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History of African Philosophy

This article traces the history of systematic African philosophy from the early 1920’s to 2014. In Plato’s Theaetetus, Socrates suggests that philosophy begins with wonder. Aristotle agreed. However, the pattern of discourse in the history of systematic African philosophy which began in the 1920s suggests that African philosophy began with frustration and not with wonder.

This frustration, according to Ruch and Anyanwu (1981:184-85), was due to historical events such as slavery, colonialism and racism that generated frustration with European philosophy. This eventually led to angry questions and then responses and reactions out of which African philosophy emerged. These reactions led to a great debate and then to more questions and reactions. So began the on-going spiral of arguments. The frustration was borne out of colonial caricature of Africa as culturally naïve, intellectually docile and rationally inept; the caricature was created by European scholars such as Kant, Hegel and, much later, Levy-Bruhl. It was the reaction to this caricature that led African scholars returning from Europe into philosophizing, The frustration about this treatment of Africa influences African philosophers to this day. It has a wider implication that touches on sensitive issues such as the identity of the African people, their place in history, and their contributions to civilization. To dethrone and undercut the colonially-built episteme became a ready attraction for African scholars’ vexed frustrations. Thus began the history of systematic African philosophy with the likes of Aimer Cisaire, Leopold Senghor, Kwame Nkrumah, Julius Nyerere, William Abraham, John Mbiti and expatriates such as Placid Tempels, Janheinz Jahn and George James.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Criteria of African Philosophy
  3. Schools of African Philosophy
    1. Ethnophilosophy School
    2. Nationalist/Ideological School
    3. Philosophic Sagacity
    4. Hermeneutical School
    5. Literary School
    6. Professional School
    7. Conversational School
  4. The Movements in African Philosophy
    1. Excavationism
    2. Afro-Constructionism/Afro-Deconstructionism
    3. Critical Reconstructionism/Afro-Eclecticism
    4. Conversationalism
  5. Periods of African Philosophy
    1. Early Period
    2. Middle Period
    3. Later Period
    4. New Era
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

African philosophy as a systematic study has a very short history. This history is also a very dense one, since actors sought to do in a few decades what would have been better done in many centuries.As a result, they also did in later years what ought to have been done earlier and vice versa, thus making the early and the middle epochs overlap considerably. The reason for this overtime endeavor is not far-fetched. Soon after colonialism, actors realized that Africa had been sucked into the global matrix unprepared. During colonial times, the identity of the African was European, his thought system, standard and even his perception were structured by the colonial shadow which stood towering behind him. It was easy for the African to position himself within these Western cultural appurtenances even though they had no real-time connection with his being.

The vanity of this presupposition and the emptiness of colonial assurances manifested soon after the towering colonial shadow vanished. Now, in the global matrix it became shameful for the African to continue to identify himself within the European colonialist milieu. For one, he had just rejected colonialism and for another, the deposed European colonialist made it clear that the identity of the African was no longer covered and insured by the European medium. So, actors realized all too sudden they had been disillusioned and had suffered severe self-deceit under colonial temper. The question which trailed every African was, “Who are you?” Of course, the answers from European perspective were savage, primitive, less than human, etc. It was the urgent, sudden need to contradict these European positions that led the post-colonial Africans in search of African identity. So, to discover or rediscover African identity in order to initiate a non-colonial or original history for Africa in the global matrix and start a course of viable economic, political and social progress that is entirely African became the focal point of African philosophy.

Placid Tempels, the European missionary, wounded by this pitiable African condition elected to help and in his controversial book, Bantu Philosophy, sought to create Africa’s own philosophy as proof that Africa has its own peculiar identity and thought system, that the African is not a nobody but somebody, that he is not savage or primitive or even less than human. However, it was George James, another concerned European who attempted a much more ambitious project in his work, Stolen Legacy. In this work, there were strong suggestions not only that Africa has philosophy but that the so-called Western philosophy, the very bastion of European identity, was stolen from Africa. This claim was intended to make the proud European colonialists feel indebted to the humiliated Africans, but it was unsuccessful. That Greek philosophy had roots in Egypt does not imply, as some Europeans claims, that Egyptians were black nor that black Africans had philosophy. The use of the term “Africans” in this work is in keepingwith George James’ demarcation which precludes the Caucasian people of North Africa and refers to the black people of southern Sahara.

After these two Europeans, Africans began to attain maturation. Aimer Cesaire, John Mbiti, Odera Oruka, Julius Nyerere, Leopold Senghor, Nnamdi Azikiwe, Kwame Nkrumah, Obafemi Awolowo, Alexis Kegame, Uzodinma Nwala, Emmanuel Edeh, Innocent Onyewuenyi, and Henry Olela, to name just a few, opened the doors of ideas. A few of the works produced sought to prove and establish the philosophical basis of African, unique identity in the history of mankind, while others sought to chart a course of Africa’s true identity through unique political and economic ideologies. Some of these works were written belatedly when the early epoch had rolled over to the middle epoch of African philosophy, such as Nwala’s Igbo Philosophy, Edeh’s Igbo Metaphysics, Olela’s, Onyewuenyi’s, Anyanwu’s and Ruch’s works, etc., to explain the position that the history of African philosophy was so dense that the two epochs overlapped considerably. The criterion for identifying where each work belongs remains the focus of much debate. The ones that seek to prove or establish Africa’s unique identity belong to the early period whereas the ones that seek to clarify, justify or criticize or deny Africa’s peculiar identity belong to the middle period. The relationship can be seen between the philosophical concerns of the early and middle periods of African philosophy.

For its concerns, the middle era of African philosophy is characterized by the great debate. Those who seek to clarify and justify the position held in the early epoch and those who seek to criticize and deny the viability of such position entangled themselves in a great debate. Some of the actors on this front include, C. S. Momoh, Robin Horton, Henri Maurier, Lacinay Keita, Peter Bodunrin, Kwasi Wiredu, Kwame Gyekye, Richard Wright, Barry Halen, Joseph Omoregbe, C. B. Okolo, Theophilus Okere, Paulin Hountondji, Gordon Hunnings, Odera Oruka and A. F. Uduigwomen to name a few.

The preceding epoch eventually gave way to the later period which has as its focus the construction of an African episteme. Two camps rivaled each other, namely the Critical Reconstructionists who are the evolved Universalists/Deconstructionists and the Eclectics who are the evolved Traditionalists/Excavators. The former seek to build an African episteme untainted by ethnophilosophy; whereas, the latter seek to do the same by a delicate fusion of relevant ideals of the two camps. In the end, Critical Reconstructionism ran into a brick wall when it became clear that whatever it produces cannot truly be called African philosophy if it is all Western without African marks. The mere claim that it would be African philosophy simply because it would be produced by Africans (Hountondji 1996 and Oruka 1975) collapses like a pack of cards under any argument. For this great failure, the influence of Critical Reconstructionism in the later period whittled down and it was latter absorbed by its rival—Eclecticism.

The works of the Eclectics heralded the emergence of the New Era in African philosophy. The focus becomes the Conversational philosophizing, or Conversationalism, in which the production of philosophically rigorous and formidable African episteme better than what the Eclectics produced occupied the center stage. It is eclectic in that the ideals of traditional and universal African philosophy are combined. But above all, it is conversational eschewing perverse dialogues and concentrating on individual creativity, originality and reconstruction.

The sum of what historians of African philosophy have done can be presented in the following two broad categorizations to wit; Pre-systematic Era and the Systematic era. The former refers to Africa’s philosophical culture, thoughts of the anonymous African thinkers and may include the problems of Egyptian legacy. The latter refers to the periods marking the return of Africa’s first eleven, Western-tutored philosophers from the 1920’s to date. This latter category could further be delineated into four periods:

    1. Early period 1920s - 1960s
    2. Middle period 1960s - 1980s
    3. Later period 1980s - 1990s
    4. New (Contemporary) Era since 1990s

Note, of course, that this does not commit us to saying that, before the early period, people in Africa never philosophized—they did.  But one fact that must not be denied is that they did not document their thoughts and, as such, scholars cannot attest to their systematicity or sources. In other words, what this periodization shows is that African philosophy as a system first began in the late 1920s.

Because there are credible objections among African philosophers with regards to the inclusion of it in the historical chart of African philosophy, the Egyptian question will be ignored for now. The main objection is that even if the philosophers of stolen legacy were able to prove a connection between Greece and Egypt, they could not prove in concrete terms that Egyptians were black Africans or that black Africans were Egyptians. It is understandable the frustration and desperation that motivated such ambitious effort in the ugly colonial era which was captured above, but any man of reason, judging by the responses of time and events in the last few decades knows it was high time Africans parted ways with that unproven legacy and let go of that now helpless propaganda.  If however, some would want to retain it as part of African philosophy, it would carefully fall within the pre-literate or the pre-systematic era.

In this essay, discussion will focus on the history of systematic or literate African philosophy touching prominently on the criteria, schools, movements and periods in African philosophy. As much as the philosophers of a given era may disagree, they are inevitably united by the problem of their epoch. That is to say, it is orthodoxy that each epoch is defined by a common focus or problem. Therefore, the approach of the study of the history of philosophy can be done either through personality periscope or through the periods, but whichever approach one chooses, he unavoidably runs into the man who had chosen the other. This is a sign of unity of focus. Thus philosophers are those who seek to solve the problem of their time. In this presentation, the study of the history of African philosophy will be approached principally through the periods, schools, movements and only discuss the personalities within these purviews. 

2. Criteria of African Philosophy

To start with, more than three decades debate on the status of philosophy ended with the affirmation that African philosophy exists. But what is it that makes a philosophy African? Answers to this question polarized actors into two main groups, namely the Traditionalists and Universalists. Whereas the Traditionalists aver that the studies of the philosophical elements in world-view of the people constitute African philosophy, the Universalists insist that it has to be a body of analytic and critical reflections of individual African philosophers. Further probing of the question was done during the debate by the end of which the question of what makes a philosophy “African” produced two contrasting criteria. First, as a racial criterion; a philosophy would be African if it is produced by Africans. This is the view held by people like Paulin Hountondji, Odera Oruka (in part), early Peter Bodunrin, Godfrey Ozumba and Innocent Asouzu, derived from the two constituting terms—“African” and “philosophy”. African philosophy following this criterion is the philosophy done by Africans. This has been criticized as pejorative, incorrect and exclusivist. Second, as a tradition criterion; a philosophy is “African” if it designates a non-racial-bound philosophy tradition where the predicate “African” is treated as a solidarity term of no racial import and where the approach derives inspiration from African cultural background or system of thought. It does not matter whether the issues addressed are African or done by an African insofar as it has universal applicability and projected from the purview of African system of thought. African philosophy would then be that rigorous discourse of African issues or any issues whatsoever from the critical eye of African system of thought. Actors like Odera Oruka (in part), Meinrad Hebga, C. S. Momoh, Udo Etuk, Joseph Omoregbe, the later Peter Bodunrin, Jonathan Chimakonam can be grouped here. This criterion has also been criticized as courting uncritical elements of the past when it makes reference to the controversial idea of African logic tradition. Further discussion on this is well beyond the scope of this essay. What is however common in the two criteria is that African philosophy is a critical discourse on issues that may or may not affect Africa by African philosophers—the purview of this discourse remains unsettled.

3. Schools of African Philosophy

a. Ethnophilosophy School

This is the foremost school in systematic African philosophy which equated African philosophy with culture-bound systems of thought. For this, their enterprise was scornfully described as substandard hence the term “ethnophilosophy.” Thoughts of the members of the Excavationism movement properly belong here and their high point was in the early period of African philosophy. 

b. Nationalist/Ideological School

The concern of this school was nationalist philosophical jingoism to combat colonialism and to create political philosophy and ideology for Africa from the indigenous traditional system as a project of decolonization. Thoughts of members of the Excavationism movement in the early period can be brought under this school. 

c. Philosophic Sagacity

There is also the philosophical sagacity school whose main focus is to show that standard philosophical discourse existed and still exists in traditional Africa and can only be discovered through sage conversations. The chief proponent of this school was the brilliant Kenyan philosopher Odera Oruka who took time to emphasize that Marcel Gruaile’s similar programme is less sophisticated than his.  But since philosophical sagacity thrives on the method of oral interview of presumed sages whose authenticity cannot be independently verified, what is produced distances itself from the sages and becomes the fruits of the interviewing philosopher. So the sage connection and the tradition became defeated. Their enterprise falls within the movement of Critical Reconstructionism of the later period.

d. Hermeneutical School

Another prominent school is the hermeneutical school. Its focus is that the best approach to studying African philosophy is through interpretations of oral traditions and emerging philosophical texts. Theophilus Okere and Okonda Okolo are some of the major proponents of this school. The confusion however is that they reject ethnophilosophy whereas the oral tradition and most of the texts available for interpretation are ethnophilosophical in nature. The works of Okere and Okolo feasted on ethno-philosophy. This school exemplifies the movement called Afro-constructionism of the middle period. 

e. Literary School

The literary school’s main concern is to make a philosophical presentation of African cultural values through literary/fictional ways. Proponents like Chinua Achebe, Cheik Anta Diop, Ngugi wa Thiong’o, Wole Soyinka to name a few have been outstanding. Yet critics have found it convenient to identify their discourse with ethnophilosophy from literary angle thereby denigrating it as sub-standard. Their enterprise remarks the movement of Afro-constructionism of the middle period.

f. Professional School

Perhaps the most controversial is the one variously described as professional, universalist or modernist school. It contends that all the other schools are engaged in one form of ethnophilosophy or the other, that standard African philosophy is critical, individual discourse and that what qualifies as African philosophy must have universal merit and thrive on the method of critical analysis and individual discursive enterprise. It is not about talking, it is about doing. Some staunch unrepentant members of this school include Kwasi Wiredu, Paulin Hountondji, Peter Bodunrin to name a few. They demolished all that has been built in African philosophy and built nothing as an alternative episteme. This school champions the movement of Afro-deconstructionism and the abortive Critical Reconstructionism of the middle and later periods respectively.

Perhaps, one of the deeper criticisms that can be leveled against the position of the professional school comes from C. S. Momoh’s scornful description of the school as African logical neo-positivism. They agitate that (1) there is nothing as yet in African traditional philosophy that qualifies as philosophy and (2) that critical analysis should be the focus of African philosophy; so what then is there to be critically analyzed? Professional school adherents are said to forget in their overt copying of European philosophy that analysis is a recent development in European philosophy which attained saturation in the 19th century after over 2000 years of historical evolution thereby requiring some downsizing. Would they also grant that philosophy in Europe before 19th century was not philosophy? The aim of this essay is not to offer criticisms of the schools but to present historical journey of philosophy in the equatorial (African) tradition. It is in opposition to and the need to fill the lacuna in the enterprise of the professional school that the new school which can be called conversational school has recently emerged in African philosophy.

g. Conversational School

This emerging school thrives on fulfilling the yearning of the professional/modernist school to have a robust individual discourse as well as fulfilling the conviction of the traditionalists that a thorough-going African philosophy has to be erected on the foundation of African thought systems. They make the most of the criterion which presents African philosophy as a critical tradition that projects individual discourses from the thought system of Africa. Some prominent members of this school include Pantaleon Iroegbu, Bruce Janz, Jonathan Chimakonam, Jennifer Vest, Innocent Asouzu and Ada Agada to name a few. Their projects promote partly the movements of Afro-eclecticism and fully the conversationalism of the later, new period respectively.

4. The Movements in African Philosophy

There are four main movements that can be identified in the history of African philosophy, they include: Excavationism, Afro-constructionism/Afro-deconstructionism, Critical Reconstructionism/Afro-Eclecticism and Conversationalism. 

a. Excavationism

The Excavators are all those who sought to erect the edifice of African philosophy by systematizing the African cultural world-views. Some of them aimed at retrieving and reconstructing presumably lost African identity from the raw materials of African culture. While others sought to develop compatible political ideologies for Africa from the native political systems of African peoples. Members of this movement have all been grouped under the school known as ethnophilosophy, and they thrived in the early period of African philosophy. Their concern was to build and demonstrate unique African identify in various forms. A few of them include Placid Tempels, Julius Nyerere, John Mbiti, Alexis Kagame, Leopold Senghor, Kwame Nkrumah and Aime Cesaire.

b. Afro-Constructionism/Afro-Deconstructionism

The Afro-deconstructions sometimes called the Modernists or the Universalists are those who sought to demote such edifice erected by the Excavators on the grounds that their raw materials are substandard cultural paraphernalia. They are opposed to the idea of unique African identity or culture-bound philosophy and preferred a philosophy that will integrate African identity with the identity of all other races in a common universalism. They never built this philosophy. Some members of this movement include Paulin Hountondji, Kwasi Wiredu, Peter Bodunrin, Macien Towa, Fabien Ebousi Boulaga, Richard Wright and Henri Maurier. Their opponents are the Afro-constructionists, sometimes called the Traditionalists or Particularists who sought to add rigor and promote the works of the Excavators as true African philosophy. Some prominent actors in this movement include Innocent Onyewuenyi, Henry Olela, Lansana Keita, C. S. Momoh, Joseph Omoregbe, Janheinz Jahn, George James, Sophie Oluwole and, in some ways, Kwame Gyekye. Members of this twin-movement have variously been grouped under ethnophilosophy, philosophic sagacity, professional, hermeneutical and literary schools and they thrived in the middle period of African philosophy. This is also known as the period of the great debate.

c. Critical Reconstructionism/Afro-Eclecticism

A few Afro-deconstructionists of the middle period evolved into Critical Reconstructionists hoping to reconstruct from the scratch the edifice of authentic African philosophy that would be critical, individualistic and universal. They hold that the edifice of ethnophilosophy, which they had demolished in the middle period, contained no critical rigor. Some of the members of this movement include, Kwasi Wiredu, Olusegun Oladipo, V. Y. Mudimbe, D. A. Masolo, Odera Oruka and, in some ways, Barry Hallen and J. O. Sodipo. Their opponents are the Afro-Eclectics who evolved from Afro-constructionism of the middle period. Unable to sustain their advocacy and the structure of ethnophilosophy they had constructed, they stepped down a little bit to say, “Maybe we can combine meaningfully, some of the non-conflicting concerns of the Traditionalists and the Modernists.” They say (1) that African traditional philosophy is not rigorous enough as claimed by the Modernists is a fact (2) that the deconstructionist program of the Modernists did not offer and is incapable of offering an alternative episteme is also a fact (3) maybe the rigor of the Modernists can be applied on the usable and relevant elements produced by the Traditionalists to produce the much elusive, authentic African philosophy. African philosophy for this movement therefore becomes a product of synthesis resulting from the application of tools of critical reasoning on the relevant traditions of African life-world.  A. F. Uduigwomen, Kwame  Gyekye, Ifeanyi Menkiti and Kwame Appiah are some of the members of this movement. This movement played a vital reconciliatory role, the importance of which was not fully realized in African philosophy. Most importantly, they found a way out of the dead luck produced by the Modernists and laid the foundation for the emergence of Conversationalism. Members of this twin-movement thrived in the later period of African philosophy.

d. Conversationalism

The Conversationalists are those who seek to create an enduring corpus in African philosophy by engaging elements of tradition and individual thinkers in critical conversations. They emphasize originality, creativity, innovation, peer-criticism and cross-pollination of ideas in prescribing and evaluating their ideas. They hold that new episteme in African philosophy can only be created by individual African philosophers who make use of the “usable past” and the depth of individual originality in finding solutions to contemporary demands. They do not lay emphasis on analysis alone but also on critical rigor and analytic-synthesis, where the latter consists of constructive synthesis from either tradition or individual thoughts. Members of this movement thrive in this contemporary period and their school can be called the conversational school. Some of the philosophers that have demonstrated this trait include Pantaleon Iroegbu, Innocent Asouzu, Bruce Janz, Jonathan Chimakonam, Ada Agada, Godfrey Ozumba and Jennifer Lisa Vest.

5. Periods of African Philosophy

a. Early Period

The early period of African philosophy is an era of the movement called cultural/ideological excavation aimed at retrieving and reconstructing African identity. The schools that emerged and thrived in this period were ethnophilosophy and ideological/nationalist schools. The Sub-Saharan Africans, Hegel wrote, had no high cultures and had made no contributions to world history and civilization (1975: 190). Lucien Levy Bruhl also added that they are pre-logical and two-third of human (1947: 17). The summary of these two positions, which represent the colonial mindset, is that Africans have no dignified identity like their European counterpart. This could be deciphered in the British colonial system which sought to erode the native thought system in the constitution of social systems in their colonies and also in the French policy of assimilation. Assimilation is a concept credited to the French philosopher Chris Talbot (1837) which rests on the idea of expanding French culture to the colonies outside of France in the 19th and 20th centuries. According to Betts (2005: 8), the natives of these colonies were considered French citizens as long as the French culture and customs were adopted to replace the indigenous system. The purpose of the theory of assimilation, for Michael Lambert, therefore, was to turn African natives into French men by educating them in the French language and culture (1993: 239-262).

During colonial times, the British, for example, educated their colonies in the British language and culture, strictly undermining the native languages and cultures. The products of this new social system were then given the impression that they were British, though second class, the king was their king, and the empire was also theirs. Suddenly, however, colonialism ended and they found, to their chagrin, that they were treated as slave countries in the new post-colonial order. Their native identity had been destroyed and their fake British identity had also been taken from them; what was left was amorphous and corrupt. It was in the heat of this confusion and frustration that the African philosophers sought to retrieve and recreate the original African identity lost in the event of colonization. Ruch and Anyanwu, therefore, ask, “What is this debate about African identity concerned with and what led to it? In other words, why should Africans search for their identity?” Their response to the questions is as follows:

The simple answer to these questions is this: Africans of the first half of this (20th century) century have begun to search for their identity, because they had, rightly or wrongly, the feeling that they had lost it or that they were being deprived of it. The three main factors which led to this feeling were: slavery, colonialism and racialism. (1981: 184-85)

Racialism, as Ruch and Anyanwu believed, may have sparked it off and slavery may have dealt the heaviest blow, but it was colonialism that entrenched it. Ironically, it was the same colonialism at its stylistic conclusion that opened the eyes of the African by stirring the hornet’s nest. Trouble started when the departing colonialists let the Africans know, to their humiliation, that the colonial identity they brandished was a fake one. An African can never be a British or French even with the colonially imposed language and culture. With this shock, the post colonial African philosophers of the early period set out in search of Africa’s lost identity.

Many actors in this period, like George James and Placid Tempels, were not native Africans but were touched by the insincerity and cold-heartedness of the departing colonialists. James in 1954 published his monumental work Stolen Legacy. In it, he worked to prove that the Egyptians were the true authors of Western philosophy; that Pythagoras, Socrates, Plato and Aristotle plagiarized the Egyptians; that the authorship of the individual doctrines of Greek philosophers is a mere speculation perpetuated chiefly by Aristotle and executed by his school; and that the African continent gave civilization knowledge, arts and sciences, religion and philosophy, a fact that is destined to produce a change in the mentality both of the European and African peoples. In G. M. James’ words:

In this way, the Greeks stole the legacy of the African continent and called it their own. And as has already been pointed out, the result of this dishonesty had been the creation of an enormous world opinion; that the African continent has made no contribution to civilization, because her people are backward and low in intelligence and culture…This erroneous opinion about the Black people has seriously injured them through the centuries up to modern times in which it appears to have reached a climax in the history of human relations. (1954: 54)

These rugged intellectual positions supported by evidential and well thought-out proofs quickly heralded a shift in the intellectual culture of the world. But there was one problem George James could not fix; he could not prove that the people of North Africa (Egyptians) who were the true authors of ancient art, sciences, religion and philosophy were black Africans, as can be seen in his hopeful but inconsistent conclusions:

This is going to mean a tremendous change in world opinion, and attitude, for all people and races who accept the new philosophy of Africa redemption, i.e. the truth that the Greeks were not the authors of Greek philosophy; but the people of North Africa; would change their opinion from one of disrespect to one of respect for the black people throughout the world and treat them accordingly. (1954: 153)

It is inconsistent how the achievements of North Africans (Egyptians) can redeem the black Africans. This is also the problem with Henri Olela’s article “The African Foundations of Greek Philosophy”.

In Onyewuenyi’s The African Origin of Greek Philosophy however, an ambitious attempt emerges to fill this lacuna in the argument of new philosophy of African redemption. In the first part of chapter two, he reduced the Greek philosophy to Egyptian philosophy, and in the second part, he attempted to further reduce the Egyptians of the time to black Africans. There are, however, two holes he could not fill. First, Egypt is the world’s oldest standing country who also told their own story by themselves in different forms. At no point did they or other historians describe them as black people. Second, if the Egyptians were at a time wholly black, why are they now wholly white? For the failure of this group of scholars to prove that black Africans were the authors of Egyptian philosophy, one must abandon the Egyptian legacy.

There are however other scholars of the early period who tried in more reliable ways to assert black identity by establishing native African philosophical heritage. One of such is Tempels who authored Bantu Philosophy (1949). He proved that rationality was an important feature of the traditional African culture. By systematizing Bantu philosophical ideas he confronted the racist orientation of the West which depicted Africa as a continent of semi-humans. In fact, Tempels showed the latent similarities in the spiritual inclinations of the Europeans and their African counterpart. In the opening passage of his work he observed that the European who has taken to atheism quickly returns to a Christian viewpoint when suffering or pain threatens his survival. In much the same way, he says the civilized or Christian Bantu returns to the ways of his ancestors when confronted by suffering and death. So, spiritual orientation or thinking is not found only in Africa.

In his attempt to explain the Bantu understanding of being, Tempels admits that this might not be the same with the understanding of the European. Instead, he argues that the Bantu construction is as much rational as that of the European. In his words:

So the criteriology of the Bantu rests upon external evidence, upon the authority and dominating life force of the ancestors. It rests at the same time upon the internal evidence of experience of nature and of living phenomena, observed from their point of view. No doubt, anyone can show the error of their reasoning; but it must none the less be admitted that their notions are based on reason, that their criteriology and their wisdom belong to rational knowledge. (1949/2006: 51)

 Tempels obviously believes that the Bantu, like the rest of the African tribes, posses rationality which undergird their philosophical enterprise. The error in their reasoning is only obvious in the light of European logic. The Bantu categories only differ from those of the Europeans, which is why a first-time European on-looker would misinterpret them to be irrational or spiritual. This effort clearly makes a case for Africa’s true identity, which, for him, could be found in African religion within which African philosophy (ontology) is subsumed. In his words, “being is force, force is being”. And the same could be said of Alexis Kagame’s work The Bantu-Rwandan Philosophy (1956), which offers similar proofs and arguments thus further strengthening the claims of Tempels, especially from an African’s perspective. The major criticism against their industry remains the association of their thoughts with ethnophilosophy, where ethnophilosophy is seen perjoratively. A much more studded criticism is offered recently by Innocent Asouzu in his work Ibuanyidanda: New Complementary Ontology (2007). His criticism was not directed at the validity of the thoughts they expressed or whether Africa could boast of a rational enterprise such as philosophy but at the logical foundation of their thoughts. Asouzu seems to quarrel with Tempels for allowing his native Aristotelian orientation to influence his construction of African philosophy and lambasts Kagame for following suit instead of correcting Tempels’ mistake. The principle of bivalence as evidenced in the Western thought system was at the background of their construction.

Another important philosopher in this period is John Mbiti. His work African Religions and Philosophy (1969) avidly educated those who doubted Africans’ possession of their own identities before the arrival of the European by excavating and demonstrating the rationality in the religious and philosophical enterprises in African cultures. He boldly declared: “We shall use the singular, ‘philosophy’ to refer to the philosophical understanding of African peoples concerning different issues of life” (1969: 2). His presentation of time in African thought shows off the pattern of excavation in his African philosophy. Although his studies focus primarily on the Kikamba and Gikuyu tribes of Africa, he observes that there are similarities in many African cultures just as Tempels did earlier.  He subsumes African philosophy in African religion on the assumption that African peoples do not know how to exist without religion. This idea is also shared by William Abraham in his book The Mind of Africa as well as Tempels’ Bantu Philosophy. African philosophy, from Mbiti’s treatment, could be likened to Tempels’ vital force, of which African religion is its outer cloak. The obvious focus of this book is on African views about God, political thought, afterlife, culture or world-view and creation, the philosophical aspects lie within these religious over-coats. Thus, Mbiti establishes that the true, and lost, identity of the African could be found within his religion. Another important observation Mbiti made is that this identity is communal and not individualistic. Hence, he states, “I am because we are and since we are therefore I am” (1969: 108). Therefore, the African has to re-enter his religion to find his philosophy and the community to find his identity.

This is a view shared by William Abraham in his The Mind of Africa (1962). He shares Tempels and Mbiti’s views that the black African tribes have many similarities in their culture, though his studies focus on the culture and political thought of the Akan of present day Ghana. Another important aspect of Abraham’s work is that he subsumed African philosophical thought in African culture taking, as Barry Hallen described, “an essentialist interpretation of African culture” (2002: 15). Thus for Abraham, like Tempels and Mbiti, the lost African identity could be found in the seabed of African indigenous culture in which religion features prominently.

On the other hand, there were those who sought to retrieve and establish once again Africa’s lost identity through economic and political ways. Some names discussed here include Kwame Nkrumah, Leopold Senghor and Julius Nyerere. These actors felt that the African could never be truly decolonized unless he found his own system of living and social organization. One cannot be African living like the European. The question that guided their study therefore became, “What system of economic and social engineering will suit us and project our true identity?” Nkrumah advocates African socialism, which, according to Barry Hallen, is an original, social, political and philosophical theory of African origin and orientation. This system is forged from the traditional, communal structure of African society, a view strongly projected by Mbiti. Nkrumah says that a return to African cultural system with its astute moral values, communal ownership of land and a humanitarian social and political engineering holds the key to Africa rediscovering her lost identity. Systematizing this process, will yield what he calls the African brand of socialism. In most of his books, he projects the idea that Africa’s lost identity is to be found in African native culture within which is African philosophical thought and identity shaped by communal orientation. Some of his works include, Neo-colonialism: The Last Stage of Imperialism (1965), I Speak of Freedom: A Statement of African Ideology (1961), Africa Must Unite (1970), and Consciencism (1954).

Leopold Sedar Senghor of Senegal charted a course similar to that of Nkrumah. In his works Negritude et Humanisme (1964) and Negritude and the Germans (1967), Senghor traced Africa’s philosophy of social engineering down to African culture, which he said is communal and laden with brotherly emotion. This is different from the European system, which he says is individualistic, having been marshaled purely by reason. He opposed the French colonial principle of assimilation aimed at turning Africans into Frenchmen by eroding and replacing African culture with French culture. African culture and languages are the bastions of African identity, and it is in this culture that he found the pedestal for constructing a political ideology that would project African lost identity. Senghor is in agreement with Nkrumah, Mbiti, Abraham and Tempels in many ways, especially with regards to the basis for Africa’s true identity.

Julius Nyerere of Tanzania is another philosopher of note in the early period of African philosophy. In his books Uhuru na Ujamaa: Freedom and Socialism (1964) and Ujamaa: The Basis of African Socialism (1968), he sought to retrieve and establish African true identity through economic and political ways. For him, Africans cannot regain their identity unless they are first free and freedom (Uhuru) transcends independence. Cultural imperialism has to be overcome. And what is the best way to achieve this if not by developing a socio-political and economic ideology from the petals of African native culture, and traditional values of togetherness and brotherliness? Hence, Nyerere proposes Ujamaa, meaning familyhood—the “being-with” philosophy or the “we” instead of the “I—spirit” (Okoro 2004: 96). In the words of Barry Hallen, “Nyerere argued that there was a form of life and system of values indigenous to the culture of pre-colonial Africa, Tanzania in particular, that was distinctive if not unique and that had survived the onslaughts of colonialism sufficiently intact to be regenerated as the basis for an African polity” (2002: 74). Thus for Nyerere, the basis of African identity is the African culture, which is communal rather than individualistic. Nyerere was in agreement with other actors of this period on the path to full recovery of Africa’s lost identity. Other philosophers of this era not treated here include Nnamdi Azikiwe, Obafemi Awolowo, Amilcar Cabral, and the two foreigners, Janheinz Jahn and Marcel Griaule.

b. Middle Period

The middle period of African philosophy is also an era of the twin-movement called Afro-constructionism and afro-deconstructionism, otherwise called the great debate, when two rival schools—Traditionalists and Universalists clashed. While the Traditionalists sought to construct an African identity based on excavated African cultural elements, the Universalists sought to demolish such architectonic structure by associating it with ethnophilosophy. The schools that thrived in this era include Philosophic Sagacity, Professional/Modernist/Universalist, Afro-hermeneutical and Literary schools.

An important factor of the early period is that the thoughts on the basis for Africa’s true identity generated arguments that fostered the emergence of the Middle Period of African philosophy. These arguments result from questions that could be summarized as follows: (1) Is it proper to take for granted the sweeping assertion that all of Africa’s cultures share a few basic elements in common? It was this assumption that had necessitated the favorite phrase in the early period, “African philosophy,” rather than “African philosophies”. (2) Does Africa or African culture contain a philosophy in the strict sense of the term? (3) Can African philosophy emerge from the womb of African religion, world-view and culture? Answers and objections to answers soon took the shape of a debate, characterizing the middle period as the era of the great debate in African philosophy.

This debate was between members of Africa’s new crop of intellectual radicals. On one hand, are the demoters and, on the other, are the promoters of African philosophy established by the league of early period intellectuals. The former sought to criticize this new philosophy of redemption, gave it a derogatory tag “ethnophilosophy” and consequently denigrated the African Identity that was founded on it as savage and primitive identity. At the other end, the promoters sought to clarify and defend this philosophy and justify the African identity that was rooted in it as true and original.

For clarity, the assessment of the debate era will begin from the middle instead of the beginning. In 1978 Odera Oruka a Kenyan philosopher presented a paper at the William Amo Symposium held in Accra, Ghana on the topic “Four Trends in Current African Philosophy” in which he identified or grouped voices on African philosophy into four schools, namely ethnophilosophy, philosophic sagacity, nationalistic-ideological school and professional philosophy. In 1990 he wrote another work, Sage Philosophy: Indigenous Thinker and the Modern Debate on African Philosophy in which he further added two schools to bring the number to six schools in African philosophy. Those two additions are the hermeneutic and artistic/literary schools.

Those who uphold philosophy in African culture are the ethnophilosophers and these include the actors treated as members of the early period of African philosophy and their followers or supporters in the Middle Period. These would include C. S. Momoh, Joseph Omoregbe, Lansana Keita, Olusegun Oladipo, Gordon Hunnings, Kwame Gyekye, M. A. Makinde, Emmanuel Edeh, Uzodinma Nwala, K. C. Anyanwu and later E. A. Ruch, to name a few. The philosophic sagacity school, to which Oruka belongs, also accommodates C. S. Momoh, C. B. Nze, J. I. Omoregbe, C. B. Okolo and T. F. Mason. The nationalist-ideological school consists of those who sought to develop indigenous socio-political and economic ideologies for Africa. Prominent members include Julius Nyerere, Leopold Senghor, Kwame Nkrumah, Amilcar Cabral, Nnamdi Azikiwe and Obafemi Awolowo. The professional philosophy school insists that African philosophy must be done with professional philosophical methods such as analysis, critical reflection and logical coherence as it is in Western philosophy. Members of this school include: Henri Maurier, Richard Wright, Peter Bodunrin, Kwasi Wiredu, early E. A. Ruch, R. Horton, and later C. B. Okolo. The hermeneutic school recommends linguistic analysis as a method of doing African philosophy. A few of its members include Theophilus Okere, Okonda Okolo, Godwin Sogolo and partly J. Sodipo and B. Hallen. The Artistic/Literary school philosophically discusses the core of African norms,  and includes Chinua Achebe, Okot P’Bitek, Ngugi wa Thiong’o, Wole Soyinka, Elechi Amadi and F. C. Ogbalu.

Also, in 1989, C. S. Momoh in his The Substance of African Philosophy outlined five schools, namely African logical neo-positivism, the colonial/missionary school of thought, the Egyptological school, the ideological school and the purist school. The article was titled “Nature, Issues and Substance of African Philosophy” and was reproduced in Jim Unah’s Metaphysics, Phenomenology and African Philosophy (1996).

In comparing Momoh’s delineations with Oruka’s, it can be said that the purist school encompasses Oruka’s ethnophilosophy, artistic/literary school and philosophic sagacity; The African logical neo-positivism encompasses  professional philosophy and the hermeneutical schools; and the ideological and colonial/missionary schools correspond to Oruka’s nationalistic-ideological school. The Egyptological school, therefore, remains outstanding. Momoh sees it as a school which sees African philosophy as synonymous with Egyptian philosophy or at least as originating from it. Also, Egyptian philosophy as a product of African philosophy is also expressed in the writings of I. C. Onyewuenyi and Henry Olela.

Welding all these divisions together are the perspectives of Peter Bodunrin and Kwasi Wiredu. In the introduction to his 1985 edited volume Philosophy in Africa: Trends and Perspectives, Bodunrin created two broad schools for all the subdivisions in both Oruka and Momoh, namely the Traditionalist and Modernist schools. While the former includes Africa’s rich culture and past, the latter excludes them from the mainstream of African philosophy. Kwasi Wiredu also made this type of division, specifically Traditional and Modernist, in his paper “On Defining African Philosophy” in C. S. Momoh’s (1989) edited volume. Also, A. F. Uduigwomen created two broad schools, namely the Universalists and the Particularists, in his “Philosophy and the Place of African Philosophy” (1995). These can be equated to Bodunrin’s Modernist and Traditionalist schools respectively. The significance of his contribution to the great debate rests on the new school he evolved from the compromise of the Universalist and the Particularist schools (1995/2009: 2-7). As Uduigwomen defines it, the Eclectic school accommodates discourses pertaining to African experiences, culture and world-view as parts of African philosophy. Those discourses must be critical, argumentative and rational. In other words, the so-called ethnophilosophy can comply with the analytic and argumentative standards that people like Bodunrin, Hountondji, and Wiredu insist upon. Many later African philosophers revived Uduigwomen’s Eclectic school as a much more decisive approach to African philosophy (Kanu 2013: 275-87). It is the era dominated by Eclecticism and meta-philosophy that is tagged the ‘Later period’ in the history of African philosophy. For perspicuity therefore, the debate from these two broad schools shall be addressed as the perspectives of the Traditionalist or Particularist and the Modernist or Universalist.

The reader must now have understood the perspectives on which the individual philosophers of the middle period debated. Hence, when Richard Wright published his critical essay “Investigating African Philosophy” and Henri Maurier published his “Do we have an African Philosophy?” denying the existence of African philosophy at least as yet, the reader understands why Lansana Keita’s “The African Philosophical Tradition”, C. S. Momoh’s African Philosophy … does it exist?” or J. I. Omoregbe’s “African Philosophy Yesterday and Today” are offered as critical responses. When Wright arrived at the conclusion that the problems surrounding the study of African philosophy are so great that others are effectively prevented from any worthwhile work until their resolution, Henri Maurier responded  to the question, “Do we have an African Philosophy?” with “No! Not Yet!” (1984: 25). One would understand why Lansana Keita took it up to provide concrete evidence that Africa had and still has a philosophical tradition. In his words:

It is the purpose of this paper to present evidence that a sufficiently firm literate philosophical tradition has existed in Africa since ancient times, and that this tradition is of sufficient intellectual sophistication to warrant serious analysis…it is rather…an attempt to offer a defensible idea of African philosophy. (1984: 58)

Keita went on in that paper to excavate intellectual resources to prove his case, but it was J. I. Omoregbe who tackled the demoters on every front. Of particular interest are his critical commentaries on the position of Kwasi Wiredu and others who share Wiredu’s opinion that what is called African philosophy is not philosophy but community thought at best. Omoregbe alludes that the logic and method of African philosophy need not be the same as those of Western philosophy, which the demoters cling to.  In his words:

It is not necessary to employ Aristotelian or the Russellian logic in this reflective activity before one can be deemed to be philosophizing. It is not necessary to carry out this reflective activity in the same way that the Western thinkers did. Ability to reason logically and coherently is an integral part of man’s rationality. The power of logical thinking is identical with the power of rationality. It is therefore false to say that people cannot think logically or reason coherently unless they employ Aristotle’s or Russell’s form of logic or even the Western-type argumentation. (1998: 4-5)

Omoregbe was addressing the position of most members of the Modernist school who believed that African philosophy must follow the pattern of Western philosophy if it were to exist. As he cautions:

Some people, trained in Western philosophy and its method, assert that there is no philosophy and no philosophizing outside the Western type of philosophy or the Western method of philosophizing (which they call “scientific” or “technical”. (1998: 5)

Philosophers like E. A. Ruch in some of his earlier writings,, Peter Bodunrin, C. B. Okolo, and Robin Horton were direct recipients of Omoregbe’s sledge hammer. Robin Horton’s “African Traditional Thought and Western Science” is a two part essay that sought in the long run to expose the rational ineptitude in African thought. On the question of logic in African philosophy, Robin Horton’s “Traditional Thought and the emerging African Philosophy Department: A Comment on the Current Debate” first stirred the hornet’s nest and was ably challenged by Godorn Hunnings’ “Logic, Language and Culture”, as well as by Omoregbe’s “African Philosophy: Yesterday and Today”. Earlier, Meinrad Hebga’s “Logic in Africa” had made insightful ground clearing on the matter. Recently, C.S. Momoh’s “The Logic Question in African Philosophy” and Udo Etuk’s “The Possibility of an African Logic” as well as Jonathan C. Okeke’s “Why can’t there be an African Logic” made impressions. However, this logic question is gathering new momentum in African philosophical discourse.

On the philosophical angle, Kwasi Wiredu’s “How not to Compare African Traditional Thought with Western Thought” responded to the lopsided earlier effort of Robin Horton but ended up making its own criticisms of the status of African philosophy which, for Wiredu, is yet to attain maturation. In his words, “[M]any traditional African institutions and cultural practices, such as the ones just mentioned, are based on superstition. By ‘superstition’ I mean a rationally unsupported belief in entities of any sort (1976: 4-8 and 1995: 194).” In his Philosophy and an African Culture, Wiredu was more pungent. He caricatured much of the discourse on African philosophy as community thought or folk thought unqualified to be called philosophy. For him, there had to be a practiced distinction between “African philosophy as folk thought preserved in oral traditions and African philosophy as critical, individual reflection, using modern logical and conceptual techniques” (1980: 14). Olusegun Oladipo supports this in his Philosophy and the African Experience. As he puts it:

But this kind of attitude is mistaken. In Africa we are engaged in the task of the improvement of “the condition of men”. There can be no successful execution of this task without a reasonable knowledge of, and control over, nature. But essential to the quest for knowledge of, and control over, nature are “logical, mathematical and analytical procedures” which are products of modern intellectual practices. The glorification of the “unanalytical cast of mind” which a conception of African philosophy as African folk thought encourages would not avail us the opportunity of taking advantage of the theoretical and practical benefits offered by these intellectual procedures. It thus can only succeed in making the task of improving the condition of man in Africa a daunting one.(1996: 15)

Oladipo also shares similar thoughts in his The Idea of African Philosophy. African philosophy for some of the Modernists is practiced in a debased sense. This position is considered opinionated by the Traditionalists. Later E. A. Ruch and K. C. Anyanwu in their African Philosophy: An Introduction to the Main Philosophical Trends in Contemporary Africa attempt to excavate the philosophical elements in folklore and myth. C. S. Momoh’s “The Mythological Question in African Philosophy” and K. C. Anyanwu’s “Philosophical Significance of Myth and Symbol in Dogon World-View” further reinforced the position of the Traditionalists.(cf. Momoh 1989 and Anyanwu 1989)

However, it took Paulin Hountondji in his African Philosophy: Myth and Reality to drive a long nail in the coffin. African philosophy, for him, must be done in the same frame as Western philosophy, including its principles, methodologies, methods and all. K. C. Anyanwu again admitted that Western philosophy is one of the challenges facing African philosophy but that only calls for systematization of African philosophy not its decimation. He made these arguments in his paper “The Problem of Method in African philosophy”.

Other arguments set Greek standards for authentic African philosophy as can be found in Odera Oruka’s “The Fundamental Principles in the Question of ‘African Philosophy’ (I)” and Hountondji’s “African Wisdom and Modern Philosophy.” They readily met with Lansana Keita’s “African Philosophical Systems: A Rational Reconstruction”, J. Kinyongo’s “Philosophy in Africa: An Existence” and even P. K. Roy’s “African Theory of Knowledge”. For every step the Modernists took, the Traditionalists replied with two, a response that lingered till the early 1990’s when a certain phase of disillusionment began to set in to quell the debate. Actors on both fronts had only then begun to reach a new consciousness, realizing that a new step had to be taken beyond the debate. Even Kwasi Wiredu who had earlier justified the debate by his insistence that “without argument and clarification, there is strictly no philosophy” (1980: 47) had to admit that it was time to do something else. For him, African philosophers had to go beyond talking about African philosophy and get down to actually doing it.

It was with this sort of new orientation which emerged from the disillusionment of the protracted debate that the later period of African philosophy was born in the 1990’s. As it is said in the Igbo proverb, “The music makers almost unanimously were changing the rhythm and the dancers had to change their dance steps.”  One of the high points of the disillusionment was the emergence of the Eclectic school in the next period called ‘the Later Period’ of African philosophy.

c. Later Period

This period of African philosophy heralds the emergence of the movements which can be called Critical Reconstructionism and Afro-Eclecticism. For the Deconstructionists of the middle period, the focus shifted from deconstruction to reconstruction of African episteme in a universally integrated way; whereas, for the eclectics, finding a reconcilable middle path between traditional African philosophy and the universal African philosophy should be paramount. Thus they advocate a shift from entrenched ethnophilosophy and universal hue to the reconstruction of African episteme if somewhat different from the imposed Westernism and the uncritical ethnophilosophy. So, both the Critical Reconstructionists and the Eclectics advocate one form of reconstruction or the other. The former desire a new episteme untainted by ethnophilosophy while the later sue for reconciled central and relevant ideals.

Not knowing how to proceed to this sort of task was a telling problem on all advocates of critical reconstruction in African philosophy such as V. Y. Mudimbe, Ebousi Boulaga, Olusegun Oladipo, Franz Crahey and Marcien Towa to name a few. At the dawn of the era, these African legionnaires pointed out, in different terms, that reconstructing African episteme was imperative. But more urgent was the need to first analyse the haggard philosophical structure patched into existence with the cement of perverse dialogues. It appeared inexorable to these thinkers and others of the time that none of these can be successful outside the shadow of Westernism. For whatever one writes which is effectively free from ethnophilosophy is either contained in Western discourse or in the very least proceeds from its logic. If it is already contained in Western narrative or proceeds from its logic, what then makes it African? This became a something of a dead-end for this illustrious group, which struggled against evolutions in their positions.

Intuitively, almost every analyst knows that discussing what has been discussed in Western philosophy or taking a lead from Western philosophy does not absolutely negate or vitiate what is produced as African philosophy. But how is this to be effectively justified? This appears to be the Achilles heel of the Critical Reconstructionists of the late era in African philosophy. The massive failure of these Critical Reconstructionists to go beyond the lines of recommendation and actually engage in reconstructing delayed their emergence as a school of thought in African philosophy. The diversionary matrix which occurred at this point ensured that the later period, which began the two rival camps ofCritical Reconstructionists and Eclectics, ended with only the Eclectics left standing. Thus dying in its embryo, Critical Reconstructionism became absorbed in Eclecticism.

The campaign for Afro-reconstructionism had first emerged in the late 1980‘s in the writings of Peter Bodunrin, Olusegun Oladipo, Kwasi Wiredu and V. Y. Mudimbe, even though principals like Marcien Towa and Franz Crahey had hinted at it much earlier. The insights of the latter two never rang bells beyond the ear-shot of identity reconstruction, which was the echo of their time. Wiredu’s cry for conceptual decolonization and Hountondji’s call for the abandonment of the ship of ethnophilosophy were in the spirit of Afro-reconstructionism of the episteme. None of the Afro-reconstructionists except for Wiredu was able to truly chart a course for reconstruction. His was linguistic even though the significance of his campaign was never truly appreciated. His 1998 work “Toward Decolonizing African Philosophy and Religion,” was a clearer recapitulation of his works of preceding years.

Beyond this modest line, no other reconstructionist crusader of the time actually went beyond deconstruction and problem identification. Almost spontaneously, Afro-reconstructionism evolved into Afro-eclecticism in the early 1990’s when the emerging Critical Reconstructionism ran into a brick wall of inactivity. The argument seems to say, “If it is not philosophically permissible to employ alternative logic different from the one in the West or methods, perhaps we can make do with the merger of the approaches we have identified in African philosophy following the deconstructions.” These approaches are the various schools of thought from ethnophilosophy, philosophic sagacity, ideological school, universal, literary to Afro-hermeneutic schools which were deconstructed into two broad approaches namely: The traditionalist school and the modernist school also called the particularist and the universalist schools.

Eclectics, therefore, are those who think that the effective integration or complementation of the African native system and the Western system could produce a viable synthesis that is first African and then modern. Andrew Uduigwomen, the Nigerian philosopher could be regarded as the founder of this school in African philosophy. In his 1995 work “Philosophy and the Place of African Philosophy,” he gave official birth to the Afro-eclecticism. Identifying the Traditionalist and Modernist schools as the Particularist and Universalist schools, he created the eclectic school by carefully unifying their goals from the ruins of the deconstructed past.

Uduigwomen states that the eclectic school holds that an intellectual romance between the Universalist conception and the Particularist conception will give rise to an authentic African philosophy. The Universalist approach will provide the necessary analytic and conceptual framework for the Particularist school. Since, according to Uduigwomen, this framework cannot thrive in a vacuum, the Particularist approach will in turn supply the raw materials or indigenous data needed by the Universalist approach. From the submission of Uduigwomen above, one easily detects that Eclecticism for him entails employing Western methods or African paraphernalia.

However, Afro-Eclecticism is not without problems. The first problem though, is that he did not supply the yardstick for determining what is to be admitted and what must be left out of the corpus of African tradition. Everything cannot meet the standard of genuine philosophy, nor should the philosophical selection be arbitrary. Hountondji, a chronic critic of traditional efforts once called Tempels’ Bantu philosophy a sham. For him, it was not African or Bantu philosophy but Tempels’ philosophy with African paraphernalia. This could be extended to the vision of Afro-eclecticism. On the contrary, it could be argued that if Hountondji agrees that the synthesis contains as little as African paraphernalia, then it is something new and in this respect can claim the tag of African philosophy. However, it leaves to be proven how philosophical that little African paraphernalia is.

Other notable eclectics include Batholomew Abanuka, Udobata Onunwa, C. C. Ekwealor and much later Chris Ijiomah. Abanuka posits in his 1994 work that a veritable way to doing authentic African philosophy would be to recognize the unity of individual things and, by extension, theories in ontology, epistemology or ethics. There is a basic identity among these because they are connected and can be unified. Following C. S. Momoh (1985: 12), Abanuka went on in A History of African Philosophy to argue that synthesis should be the ultimate approach to doing African Philosophy. This position is shared by Onunwa on a micro level. He says that realities in African world-view are inter-connected and inter-dependent (1991: 66-71). Ekwealor and Ijiomah also believe in synthesis, noting that these realities are broadly dualistic, being physical and spiritual (cf. Ekwalor 1990: 30 and Ijiomah 2005: 76 and 84). So, it would be an anomaly to think of African philosophy as chiefly an exercise in analysis rather than synthesis. The ultimate methodological approach to doing African philosophy, therefore, has to reflect unity of methods above all else.

Eclecticism survived in the New Era of African philosophy in conversational forms. Godfrey Ozumba and Jonathan Chimakonam on Njikoka philosophy, E. G. Ekwuru and later Innocent Egwutuorah on Afrizealotism and even Innocent Asouzu on Ibuanyidanda ontology are all various forms of eclectic thinking. However, these theories are grouped in the New Era specifically for the time of their emergence and the conversational structure they have.

The purest development of eclectic thinking in the later period could be found in Pantaleon Iroegbu’s Uwa Ontology. He posits uwa (worlds) as an abstract generic concept with fifteen connotations and six zones. Everything is uwa, in uwa and can be known through uwa. For him, while the fifteen connotations are the different senses and aspects which uwa concept carries in Igbo-African thought, the six zones are the spatio-temporal locations of the worlds in terms of their inhabitants. He adds that these six zones are dualistic and comprise of the earthly and the spiritual. They are also dynamic and mutually relate. Thus, Iroegbu suggests that the approach to doing authentic African philosophy could consist in the conglomeration of uwa. This demonstrates a veritable Eclectic method in African philosophy.

However, one of the major hindrances of Eclecticism of the later period is that it leads straight to applied philosophy. Following this approach in this period almost makes it impossible for second readers to do original and abstract philosophizing for its own sake. Eclectic theories and methods confine one to their internal dynamics believing that for a work to be regarded as authentic African philosophy, it must follow the rules of Eclecticism. The wider implication is that while creativity might blossom, innovation and originality are stifled. Because of pertinent problems such as these, further evolutions in African philosophy became inevitable. The Kenyan philosopher Odera Oruka had magnified the thoughts concerning individual rather than group philosophizing, thoughts that had been variously expressed earlier by Peter Bodunrin, Paulin Hountondji and Kwasi Wiredu, who further admonished African philosophers to stop talking and start doing African philosophy. And V. Y. Mudimbe, in his The Invention of Africa…, suggested the development of an African conversational philosophy, and the reinvention of Africa by its philosophers, to undermine the Africa that Europe invented. The content of Lewis Gordon’s essay “African Philosophy’s search for Identity: Existential consideration of a recent effort” suggests a craving for a new line of development for African philosophy—a new approach which is to be critical, analytical and universal while still being African. This, in particular, is the spirit of the conversational African philosophy beginning to grip African philosophers in late 1990’s when Gordon wrote his paper. Influences from these thoughts by the turn of the millennium year crystallized into a new mode of thinking, which then metamorphosed into conversational philosophy. The New Era in African philosophy was thus heralded. The focus of this New Era and the orientation became the conversational philosophy.

d. New Era

This period of African philosophy began in the late 1990’s and took shape by the turn of the millennium years. The orientation of this period is conversational philosophy, so, conversationalism is the movement that thrives in this era. In the Calabar School of Philosophy, three prominent schools of thought emerged, namely Interrogatory Theory, Ibuanyidanda and Njikoka philosophies. Conversational philosophy is defined by the active engagement of individual African philosophers in the creation of critical narratives either by engaging the elements of tradition or straight-forwardly by producing new thoughts or by engaging other individual thinkers. So there is critical analysis, critical synthesis, theoretical evaluation, re-enforcements and purifications of the thoughts of other African philosophers in ways that upgrade them to metanarrative of African philosophy. These also make such thoughts universal although with the primary purpose of solving African problems. In this era, the synthesis of the later period evolves into critical synthesis and the degraded critical analysis returns in full force.

Some of the noisy proponents of conversational African philosophy in this era ironically have emerged in the Western world, notably in America. The American philosopher Jennifer Lisa Vest is noted principally for this campaign. Another champion is the brilliant Bruce Janz, ironically, a white American philosopher. He too, is an ardent scholar in African philosophy. These two, to name a few, posit that the highest purification of African philosophy is to be realized in conversational philosophizing.

However, it was the Nigerian philosopher Innocent Asouzu who went beyond the earlier botched attempt of Leopold Senghor and transcended the foundations of Pantaleon Iroegbu to erect a new model of African philosophy. The New Era, therefore, is the beginning of that African philosophy, and Innocent Asouzu, according to the young Nigerian philosopher Ada Agada, arguably could be regarded as the father of it. It is believed that he beat his compatriot, the imaginative Pantaleon Iroegbu, whose career was cut short by death, to this honor. Ada Agada believes Asouzu also beat the illustrious Ghanaian philosopher Kwasi Wiredu to this honor simply by the dense, constructionist flavor of his works.. The importance of Wiredu in African philosophy cannot be fully captured in an expression,thought the most prolific says,  “One can add that without a Wiredu there may never have been an Asouzu in African philosophy.” Yet, there is a touch in Asouzu’s works that make him stand out. Wiredu may therefore be properly regarded as a forerunner.  Wiredu may be regarded as the John de Baptiste of African philosophy, in that he identified problems and suggested ways of constructing a more modern African philosophy for decades. He was preparing the mind of Africa for the arrival of a new African philosophy. In the same light, Ngugi wa Thiong’o (cf. 1986) spoke of decolonizing the African mind while Amilcar Cabral (cf. 1969), the Guinean nationalist, recommended what he called “return to the source,” a sort of re-africanization of the colonized people of Africa through philosophical re-education. This re-education is necessary for the recovery and re-integration of Africans brainwashed through the colonial education or, as some have said, mis-education to borrow the favored concept of Ivan Illich in his Deschooling the Society. The colonial mis-education, which is said to have consisted in the transfer of foreign system of thought and the denigration of the indigenous one, eventually created out of the so-called Africans what Tempels Placid, in Bantu Philosophy, calls évoléus, or the deracinés (1949/2006: 13).  These are those Africans who have been torn away from the traditional ways of life and the thoughts of their own ethnic group. They have taken on those of the West, which they have been made to believe represent civilization.

However, to do a new African philosophy is as important as to prepare for it. This is the ultimate focus of Wiredu’s campaign. Wiredu’s style of cry and hue was adopted extensively by some who became his latter contemporaries, namely V. Y. Mudimbe, who spoke of the post-colonial Africa that was invented by the West and which needs to be re-invented for authentic African philosophy to take root in his book, The Invention of African. D. A. Masolo, the Kenyan philosopher, also followed in these footsteps in his book African Philosophy in search of Identity. For him, the true African identity was corrupted and compromised by colonialism, and it was the task of African thinkers to reconstruct the true African identity from which the authentic African philosophy will grow out of particular cultural condition and pursue varied constructions of African reality, problems and methods of acquiring relevant and new knowledge.

Paulin Hountondji was another thinker to be influenced by Wiredu’s line of thought. A Benin philosopher, it seems from the extreme tone of his works that he is an unrepentant évoléus. He sees nothing good in ethnophilosophy, a term he has been incorrectly credited for coining in order to correlate it with all previous attempts to articulate African philosophy from the traditional orientation (cf. Bodunrin 1984: ft.3, 21). The difference between him and Wiredu is that he seems to advocate the assimilation and retention of the colonial system of thought. He radicalizes Wiredu’s campaign of rigor for African philosophy by outright denigration of an African system of thought. Such uniqueness he assumes is debased and crystallizes in what he calls the “myth of unanimism” (1996: 61). The undoing of his argument is the implication of his thought that to be capable of philosophizing at all, Africans must adopt the colonial system of thought. This separates him from the pack of Wiredu-loyalists. As celebrated as his works have been, they are no less controversial. For one, some think his African Philosophy: Myth and Reality is a bad mark in African philosophy. The premise of his argument is faulty from the start. The idea of African traditions and indigenous systems of thought polluting the philosophy Africans seek to construct and reduce it to ethnophilosophy is faulty. Also, the suggestion that constructing a philosophical tradition that would engender African thought systems is tantamount to constructing a debased philosophy is misleading. It is the approach, not the paraphernalia of African culture that makes a thought fall under ethnophilosophy. Despite Hountondji’s elaborate admission, the African indigenous system of thought is not inferior to that of Europe The philosophy it will yield would be unique. Two sets of questions that might startle and expose the weak-ends in Hountondji’s advocacy are:

  1. If an African indigenous thought system makes Africans and their philosophy inferior to those of the colonialist, can the assimilation of Western thought system make Africans and the philosophy they would construct through it equal to the colonialists? And could such Africans and their philosophy be truly called African with Western background thought system?
  2. When Africans leave off everything that makes them African (traditions, culture, thought system, etc.,) and adopt those of the West in a cheap search for belongingness, do they become Westerners by default? Would they still remain Africans? Or do they now become évolués? Is being unique actually the same as being inferior? And is being like the West actually the same as being non-inferior?

Hountondji’s failure to understand these lines of difference led him to what is perhaps the greatest philosophical misinformation in any liberation struggle. By way of analogy, Hountondji is asking Africans to abandon their thatch house, move across the street and seek admission into the colonialist mansion where they will sleep in the garden working as gardeners. This, he says, would make Africans equal to the European, the Lord of the Mansion. Perhaps, it is the feeling of having left the thatch house and being within the walls of the colonialist mansion that can delude such an African into thinking that he is now on par with the owner of the mansion. Hountondji forgets in his excitement that the owner of the mansion, to which the African is a gardener, does not and cannot share this sentiment. You cannot beat a man in his home; every such mansion has but one master.

The mansion of Western philosophy was not built in a day and was once like the African thatch house. When readers see the speculations of Homer, Hesiod and even the Ionian philosophers they wink in amusement. Plato’s eugenics for examples, the position of the Cynics and Aristotle’s grave ignorance with regards to slaves and women, represent the thatch house of European philosophy. For Hountondji to advise Africans to abandon their thatch house instead of seeking ways to turn it into a befitting mansion is the height of philosophical indolence. The confirmation of this indolence is that Hountondji, living within the Eldorado world of the colonialist philosophical mansion, has not been able to construct any theory to exemplify the structure he proposes for African philosophy. So where is the paradise he promises? It does seem better therefore, to remain in the thatch house and rebuild it into a mansion like Neurath’s Mariner, which was rebuilt plank by plank whilst Neurath was on board the ship, than to abandon what is truly African to become a gardener in another man’s mansion. Most African évolués, it is safe to declare, who have written or are writing on the subject of philosophy are nothing but commentators on Western philosophy.

The orientation of crying the hue and sermon-crusading of Kwasi Wiredu was replaced by Pantaleon Iroegbu’s theoretic framing. He began the actual doing of African philosophy in accordance with the recommendations of Wiredu and his apostles such as Olusegun Oladipo, Peter Bodunrin, Lansana Keita, V. Y. Mudimbe, D. A. Masolo to name a few. Theophilus Okere and the Congolese philosopher Okonda Okolo, Marcien Towa as well as Wamba Dia Wamba in some fashion can also be brought under this category.

Iroegbu in his Metaphysics: The Kpim of Philosophy inaugurated the reconstructive and conversational approach in African philosophy. He engaged previous writers in a critical conversation out of which he produced his own thought, (Uwa ontology) bearing the stain of African tradition and thought systems but remarkably different in approach and method of ethnophilosophy. Franz Fanon has highlighted the importance of sourcing African philosophical paraphernalia from African indigenous culture. This is corroborated in a way by Lucius Outlaw in his African Philosophy: Deconstructive and Reconstructive Challenges. In it, Outlaw advocates the deconstruction of the European-invented Africa to be replaced by a reconstruction to be done by conscientious Africans free from the grip of colonial mentality (1996: 11). Whereas the Wiredu’s crusade sought to deconstruct the invented Africa, actors in the New Era of African philosophy seek to reconstruct through conversational approach. The conversational approach is a method of critical engagement of tradition or the individual thinkers that aims at criticisms, reconstructions and constructive syntheses.

Iroegbu inaugurated this drive but it was Asouzu who has made the most of it. His theory of Ibuanyidanda ontology or complementary reflection maintains that “to be” simply means to be in a mutual, complementary relationship (2007: 251-55). Every being, therefore, is a variable with capacity to join a mutual interaction. In this capacity every being alone is seen as a missing link and serving a missing link of reality in the network of realities. One immediately suspects the apparent contradiction that might arise from the fusion of two opposed variables when considered logically. But the logic of this theory is not the two-valued classical logic but the three-valued African logic (cf. Chimakonam 2012, 2013 and 2014a). In this, the two standard values are contraries rather than contradictories thereby facilitating effective complementation of variables. The possibility of the two standard values merging to form the third value in the complementary mode is what makes ezumezu logic a powerful tool of thought.

Other emerging theories of conversational and reconstructive African philosophy came later. These include the Interrogatory Theory of J. O. Chimakonam; Njikoka philosophy, or integrative humanism, credited to Godfrey Ozumba and J. O. Chimakonam consolationism, which is credited to the emerging Nigerian philosopher Ada Agada and Afrizealotism developed by E. G. Ekwuru are some of the theories that have left their domains and are spreading.

Interrogatory Theory is a social philosophy which holds that societies ride on the wheels of institutions. Institutions are social structures or building blocks of any society. Repressive colonial times in Africa replaced traditional institutions with non-compatible ones ignoring any usable part of tradition and admittted without censorship every element in the imposed modernity. Hence, social structures in postcolonial Africa are ram-shackled, creating the massive retrogression of the continent’s social order. To get Africa on its feet and moving in the right direction requires the reconstruction of the social structures of Africa’s modernity and the construction of its futurity. Interrogatory theory is therefore conceived as a conversational algorithm that would provide the theoretical base for the African renaissance (Chimakonam 2014b: 1). It constructively questions rather than being exclusively critical; it questions to reconstruct rather than being merely critical to deconstruct, is dialogical rather than merely individualistic, rigorous rather than merely informative yet radical rather than being conventional.

Njikoka philosophy sees the question of being as central in African philosophy. “To be” therefore, is to be in a mutual, integrative relationship. Njikoka, meaning integration, maintains that being is being only if it is in a network of other beings. Isolated from this network, there is strictly no being because true beings depend for their existences on the mutuality and on the network to which they inevitably belong. This prompts the integrativists to regard every being as a necessarily link of reality (Chimakonam 2013: 79). Within the network of reality, every being therefore is necessary. The same logic which undergirds Asouzu’s Ibuanyidanda philosophy is the driving principle of this theory.

Ada Agada’s consolationism is an existentialist theory which reflects on African experiences. In a way, it seeks to answer such existential questions already raised in Western philosophy but from African perspectives. The melancholy man is the 21st century human beleaguered by existential problems, some of which are beyond him and leave him seeking consolation as the only remaining option. The emotional man, which Senghor erroneously announced as the Negro, was in fact, according to Ada Agada, the universal man. The much taunted reason or rationality of man emerged from emotions. Thus, science, art, religion and philosophy find their bearing in the immanent space of human joy and sadness. The goal of being in the world is a struggle to avoid sadness and achieve joy. Consolationism therefore, subverts the Western category of being and replaces it with the category of mood. For when man fails to achieve joy and is rather sad, he finds consolation by finding God or anything that serves this purpose.

Afrizealotism is an existential theory which seeks to reconstruct the African being, or humanism. In the post colonial era, the African emerged distorted, not purely African but not purely Western. This is due to the colonial contamination of the African system of thought. Afrizealotism therefore, seeks, not to purge the Western influences totally, and certainly not to admit all of African tradition without censorship, but to produce a viable synthesis by sifting new and relevant variables from the Western system that is sufficient without making the new synthesis Western. All the while, it seeks to retain enough relevant African traditions to ensure that the synthesis is African but not archaic. This presupposes a logic that is dynamic and at least three-valued. Like Iroegbu Asouzu, Ozumba, Chimakonam and Agada, the champions of Afrizealotism are building the new edifice by reconstructing the deconstructed domain of thought in the later period of African philosophy. The central approach is conversation. By engaging other African philosophers or tradition in critical and positive discourses, they hope to reconstruct the deconstructed edifice of African philosophy. Hence, the New Era of African philosophy is safe from the retrogressive, perverse dialogues which characterized the early and middle periods.

Also, with the critical deconstruction that occurred in the later part of the middle period and the attendant eclecticism that emerged in the later period, the stage was set for the formidable reconstructions and conversational encounters that marked the arrival of the New Era of African philosophy.

6. Conclusion

The development of African philosophy through the periods yields two vital conceptions for African philosophy, namely that African philosophy is a critical engagement of tradition and individual thinkers on one hand, and on the other hand it is also a critical construction of futurity. When individual African philosophers engage tradition critically in order to ascertain its logical coherency and universal validity, they are doing African philosophy. And when they employ the tools of logic in doing this, they are doing African philosophy. On the second conception, when African philosophers engage in critical conversations with one another and in construction of new thoughts in matters that concern Africa but which are nonetheless universal and projected from African native thought systems, they are doing African philosophy. So, the authentic African philosophy is not just a future project, it can also continue from the past.

On the whole, this essay discussed the journey of African philosophy from the beginning and focused through to the criteria, schools and movements in African philosophical tradition. The historical account of the periods in African philosophy began with the early period through to the middle, the later and finally the new periods of African philosophy have also been covered taking particular interest in the robust, individual contributions. The history of systematic African philosophy is a child of frustration, not wonder. This does not however, imply that African philosophers do not initiate some of their reflections from wonder; they actually do, particularly the emerging conversational school. There are still some questions which trail the development of African philosophy, many of which include, “Must African philosophy be tailored to the pattern of Western philosophy, even in less definitive issues? If African philosophy is found to be different in approach from Western philosophy, — so what? Are logical issues likely to play any major roles in the structure and future of African philosophy? What is the future direction of African philosophy? Is the problem of the language of African philosophy pregnant? Would conversations in contemporary African philosophy totally eschew perverse dialogue? What shall be the rules of engagement in African philosophy?” These questions are likely to shape the next lines of thought in African philosophy.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Abanuka, Batholomew. A History of African Philosophy. Enugu: Snaap Press, 2011.
    • An epochal discussion of African philosophy.
  • Abraham, William. The Mind of Africa. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1962.
    • A philosophical discussion of culture, African thought and colonial times.
  • Achebe, Chinua. Morning yet on Creation Day. London: Heinemann, 1975.
    • A philosophical treatment of African tradition and colonial burden.
  • Anyanwu, K. C. “Philosophical Significance of Myth and Symbol in Dogon World-view”. C. S. Momoh ed. The Substance of African Philosophy. Auchi: APP Publications, 1989
    • A discussion of the philosophical elements in an African culture.
  • Aristotle. Metaphysica, Translated into English under the editorship of W. D. Ross, M.A., Hon. LL.D (Edin.) Oxford. Vol. VIII, Second Edition, OXFORD at the Clarendon Press 1926. Online Edition. 982b.
    • A translation of Aristotle’s treatise on metaphysics.
  • Asouzu I. Innocent. Ibuanyidanda: New Complementary Ontology Beyond World-Immanentism, Ethnocentric Reduction and Impositions. Litverlag, Münster, Zurich, New Brunswick, London, 2007
    • An African perspective treatment of metaphysics or the theory of complementarity of beings.
  • Babalola, Yai. “Theory and Practice in African Philosophy: The Poverty of Speculative Philosophy. A Review of the Work of P. Hountondji, M. Towa, et al.” Second Order, 2. 2. 1977
    • A Critical review of Hountondji and Towa.
  • Betts, Raymond. Assimilation and Association in French Colonial Territory 1890 to 1915. (First ed. 1961), Reprinted. Nebraska: University of Nebraska Press, 2005
    • A discourse on French colonial policies.
  • Bodunrin, Peter. “The Question of African Philosophy”. Richard Wright (ed) African Philosophy: An Introduction 3rd ed. Lanham: UPA, 1984.
    • A discourse on the nature and universal conception of African philosophy.
  • Cesaire Aimer. Return to My Native Land. London: Penguin Books, 1969
    • A presentation of colonial impact on the mind of the colonized.
  • Chimakonam, O. Jonathan. “Ezumezu: A Variant of Three-valued Logic—Insights and Controversies”. Paper presented at the Annual Conference of the Philosophical Society of Southern Africa. Free State University, Bloemfontein, South Africa. Jan. 20-22, 2014.
    • An articulation of the structure of Ezumezu/African logic tradition.
  • Chimakonam, O. Jonathan.“Principles of Indigenous African Logic: Toward Africa’s Development and Restoration of African Identity” Paper presented at the 19th Annual Conference of International Society for African Philosophy and Studies [ISAPS], ‘50 Years of OAU/AU: Revisiting the Questions of African Unity, Identity and Development’. Department of Philosophy, Nnamdi Azikiwe University, Awka. 27th – 29th May, 2013
    • A presentation of the principles of Ezumezu/African logic tradition.
  • Chimakonam, O. Jonathan.“Integrative Humanism: Extensions and Clarifications”. Integrative Humanism Journal. 3.1, 2013.
    • Further discussions on the theory of integrative humanism.
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. The Souls of Black Folk. (1903). New York: Bantam Classic edition, 1989
    • A discourse on race and cultural imperialism.
  • Edeh, Emmanuel. Igbo Metaphysics. Chicago: Loyola University Press, 1985.
    • An Igbo-African discourse on the nature being.
  • Ekwealor, C. “The Igbo World-View: A General Survey”. The Humanities and All of Us.
  • Emeka Oguegbu (ed) Onitsha: Watchword, 1990.
    • A philosophical presentation of Igbo life-world.
  • Etuk, Udo. “The Possibility of African logic”. The Third Way in African Philosophy, Olusegun Oladipo (ed). Ibadan: Hope Publications, 2002
    • A discussion of the nature and possibility of African logic.
  • Franz, Fanon. The Wretched of the Earth. London: The Chaucer Press, 1965.
    • A critical discourse on race and colonialism.
  • Graiule, Marcel. Conversations with Ogotemmêli, London: Oxford University Press for the International African Institute, 1965.
    • An interlocutory presentation of African philosophy.
  • Gyekye, Kwame.  An Essay in African Philosophical Thought: The Akan Conceptual Scheme. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1987.
    • A discussion of philosophy from an African cultural view point.
  • Hallen, Barry.  A Short History of African Philosophy. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2002.
    • A presentation of the history of African philosophy from thematic and personality perspectives.
  • Hallen, B. and J. O. Sodipo. Knowledge, Belief and Witchcraft:  Analytic Experiments in African Philosophy. Palo Alto, CA: Stanford University Press, 1997.
    • An analytic discourse of the universal nature of themes and terms in African philosophy.
  • Hebga, Meinrad. “Logic in Africa”. Philosophy Today, Vol.11 No.4/4 (1958).
    • An extrapolation on the structure of African logical tradition.
  • Hegel, Georg. Lectures on the Philosophy of World History. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, reprint 1975
    • Hegel’s discussion of his philosophy of world history.
  • Horton, Robin. “African Traditional Religion and Western Science” in Africa 37: 1 and 2, 1967.
    • A comparison of African and Western thought.
  • Horton, Robin. "Traditional Thought and the Emerging African Philosophy Department: A Comment on the Current Debate” in Second Order: An African Journal of Philosophy vol. III No. 1, 1977.
    • A logical critique of the idea of African philosophy.
  • Hountondji, Paulin. African Philosophy: Myth and Reality. Second Revised ed. Bloomington, Indiana: University Press, 1996.
    • A critique of ethnophilosophy and an affirmation of African philosophy as a universal discourse.
  • Hunnings, Gordon. “Logic, Language and Culture”. Second Order: An African Journal of Philosophy, Vol.4, No.1. (1975).
    • A critique of classical logic and its laws in African thought and a suggestion of African logical tradition.
  • Ijiomah, Chris. An Excavation of a Logic in African World-view”. African Journal of Religion, Culture and Society. 1. 1. (August, 2006): pp.29-35.
    • An extrapolation on a possible African logic tradition.
  • Iroegbu, Pantaleon. Metaphysics: The Kpim of Philosophy. Owerri: International Universities Press, 1995.
    • A conversational presentation of theory of being in African philosophy.
  • Jacques, Tomaz. “Philosophy in Black: African Philosophy as a Negritude”. Discursos
    • Postcoloniales Entorno Africa. CIEA7, No. 17,  7th Congress of African Studies.
    • A critique of the rigor of African philosophy as a discipline.
  • James, George . Stolen Legacy: Greek Philosophy is Stolen Egyptian Philosophy. New York: Philosophical Library, 1954.
    • A philosophical discourse on race, culture, imperialism and colonial deceit.
  • Jahn, Janheinz. Muntu: An Outline of Neo-African Culture. New York: Grove Press, 1961.
    • A presentation of a new African culture as a synthesis and as philosophical relevant and rational.
  • Jewsiewicki, Bogumil. “African Historical Studies: Academic Knowledge as ‘usable past’ and Radical Scholarship”. The African Studies Review. Vol. 32. No. 3, December, 1989.
    • A discourse on the value of African tradition to modern scholarship.
  • Keita, Lansana. “The African Philosophical Tradition”. Wright, Richard A., ed. African Philosophy: An Introduction. 3rd ed. Lanham, Md.: University Press of America, 1984.
    • An examination of African philosophical heritage.
  • Keita, Lansana. “Contemporary African Philosophy: The Search for a Method”. Tsanay Serequeberhan (ed) African Philosophy: The Essential Readings. New York: Paragon House, 1991.
    • An analysis of methodological issues in and basis of African philosophy.
  • Lambert, Michael. “From Citizenship to Négritude: Making a Difference in Elite Ideologies of Colonized Francophone West Africa”. Comparative Studies in Society and History, Vol. 35, No. 2. (Apr., 1993), pp. 239–262.
    • A discourse on the problems of colonial policies in Francophone West Africa.
  • Lewis Gordon. “African Philosophy’s Search for Identity: Existential Considerations of a recent Effort”. The CLR James Journal, Winter 1997, pp. 98-117.
    • A survey of the identity crisis of African philosophical tradition.
  • Leo Apostel. African Philosophy. Belgium: Scientific Publishers, 1981.
    • An Afrocentrist presentation of African philosophy.
  • Levy-Bruhl, Lucien. Primitive Mentality. Paris: University of France Press, 1947.
    • A Eurocentrist presentation of non-European world.
  • Makinde, M.A. Philosophy in Africa. The Substance of African philosophy. C.S. Momoh. Ed. Auchi: African Philosophy Projects’ Publications. 2000.
    • A discourse on the practise and relevance of philosophy in Africa.
  • Masolo, D. A. African Philosophy in Search of Identity. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1994.
    • An individual-based presentation of the history of African philosophy.
  • Maurier, Henri. “Do We have an African Philosophy?”. Wright, Richard A., ed. 1984. African Philosophy: An Introduction. 3rd ed. Lanham, Md.: University Press of America, 1984.
    • A critique of Ethnophilosophy as authentic African philosophy.
  • Mbiti, John. African Religions and Philosophy. London: Heinemann,1969.
    • A discourse on African philosophical culture.
  • Momoh, Campbell. “Canons of African Philosophy”. Paper presented at the 6th Congress of the Nigerian Philosophical Association. University of Ife, July 31- August 3, 1985.
    • A presentation of the major schools of thought in African philosophy.
  • Momoh, Campbell .ed. The Substance of African Philosophy. Auchi: APP Publications, 1989.
    • A collection of essays on different issues in African philosophy.
  • Momoh, Campbell. “The Logic Question in African Philosophy”. C. S. Momoh ed. The Substance of African Philosophy. Auchi: APP Publications, 1989.
    • A defense of the thesis of a possible African logic tradition.
  • Mudimbe, V. Y. The Invention of Africa: Gnosis, Philosophy and the Order of Knowledge (African Systems of Thought). Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1988.
    • A discourse on culture, race, Eurocentrism and modern Africa as an invention of Western scholarship.
  • Ngugi wa Thiong’o. 1986. Decolonizing the Mind: The Politics of Language in African Literature. London: J. Curry and Portsmouth, N. H: Heinemann, 1986.
    • A discourse on Eurocentrism, Africa’s decolonization and cultural imperialism.
  • Nkrumah, Kwame. I Speak of Freedom: A Statement of African Ideology. London: Mercury Books, 1961.
    • A discourse on political ideology for Africa.
  • Nkrumah, Kwame. Towards Colonial Freedom. London: Heinemann. (First published in 1945), 1962.
    • A discussion of colonialism and its negative impact on Africa.
  • Nwala, Uzodinma. Igbo Philosophy. London: Lantern Books, 1985.
    • An Afrocentrist presentation of Igbo-African philosophical culture.
  • Nyerere, Julius. Freedom and Unity. Dares Salaam: Oxford University Press, 1986.
    • A discussion of a postcolonial Africa that should thrive on freedom and unity.
  • Nyerere, Julius. Freedom and Socialism. Dares Salaam: Oxford University Press, 1986.
    • A discourse on the fundamental traits of African socialism.
  • Nyerere, Julius. Ujamaa—Essays on Socialism. Dar-es-Salaam, Tanzania: Oxford University Press, 1986.
    • A collection of essays detailing the characteristics of African brand of socialism.
  • Ogbalu, F.C. Ilu Igbo: The Book of Igbo Proverbs. Onitsha: University Publishing Company, 1965.
    • A philosophical presentation of Igbo-African proverbs.
  • Okeke, J. Chimakonam. “Why Can’t There be an African logic?”. Journal of Integrative Humanism. 1. 2. (2011). 141-152.
    • A defense of a possible African logic tradition and a critique of critics.
  • Okere, Theophilus. “The Relation between Culture and Philosophy,” in Uche 2 1976.
    • A discourse on the differences and similarities between culture and philosophy.
  • Okere, Theophilus. African Philosophy: A Historico-Hermeneutical Investigation of the Conditions of Its Possibility. Lanham, Md.: University Press of America, 1983.
    • A hermeneutical discourse on the basis of African philosophy.
  • Okolo, Chukwudum B. Problems of African Philosophy.  Enugu: Cecta Nigeria Press, 1990.
    • An x-ray of the major hindrances facing African philosophy as a discipline.
  • Okoro, C. M. African Philosophy: Question and Debate, A Historical Study. Enugu: Paqon Press, 2004.
    • A historical presentation of the great debate in African philosophy.
  • Oladipo, Olusegun. (ed) The Third Way in African Philosophy. Ibadan: Hope, 2002.
    • A collection of essays on the topical issues in African philosophy of the time.
  • Oladipo, Olusegun. Core Issues in African Philosophy. Ibadan: Hope Publications, 2006.
    • A discussion of central issues of African philosophy.
  • Olela, Henry. “The African Foundations of Greek Philosophy”. Wright, Richard A., ed. African Philosophy: An Introduction. 3rd ed. Lanham, Md.: University Press of America, 1984.
    • An Afrocentrist presentation of African philosophy as the source of Greek philosophy.
  • Oluwole, Sophie. Philosophy and Oral Tradition. Lagos: Ark Publications, 1999.
    • A cultural presentation of African philosophy.
  • Omoregbe, Joseph. “African Philosophy: Yesterday and Today”. African Philosophy: An Anthology. Emmanuel Eze (ed.), Massachusetts: Blackwell, 1998.
    • A survey of major issues in the debate and a critique of the Universalist school.
  • Onunwa, Udobata. “Humanism: The Bedrock of African Traditional Religion and Culture”. Religious Humanism. Vol. XXV, No. 2, Spring 1991, Pp 66 – 71.
    • A presentation of Humanism as the basis for African religion and culture.
  • Onyewuenyi, Innocent. African Origin of Greek Philosophy: An Exercise in Afrocentrism. Enugu: SNAAP Press, 1993.
    • An Afrocentrist presentation of philosophy as a child of African thought.
  • Oruka, H. Odera. “The Fundamental Principles in the Question of ‘African Philosophy,’ I.” Second Order 4, no. 1: 44–55, 1975.
    • A discussion of the main issues in the debate on African philosophy.
  • Oruka, H. Odera.“Four Trends in African Philosophy.” In Philosophy in the Present Situation of Africa, edited by Alwin Diemer. Weisbaden, Germany: Franz Steiner Erlagh. (First published in 1978), 1981; Ed.
    • A breakdown of the major schools of thought in the debate on African philosophy.
  • Oruka, H. Odera. Sage Philosophy: Indigenous Thinkers and the Modern Debate on African Philosophy. Leiden: E. J. Brill. 1990.
    • A survey of the journey so far in African philosophy and the identification of two additional schools of thought.
  • Outlaw, Lucius. “African ‘Philosophy’? Deconstructive and Reconstructive Challenges.” In his On Race and Philosophy. New York and London: Routledge. 1996.
    • A presentation of African philosophy as a tool for cultural renaissance.
  • Plato. Theætetus,155d, p.37.
    • Contains Plato’s theory of knowledge.
  • Ruch, E. A. and Anyawnu, K. C. African Philosophy: An Introduction to the Main Philosophical Trends in Contemporary Africa. Rome: Catholic Book Agency, 1981.
    • A discussion on racialism, slavery, colonialism and their influence on the emergence of African philosophy, in addition to current issues in the discipline.
  • Sogolo, Godwin. Foundations of African Philosophy. Ibadan: Ibadan University Press, 1993.
    • A discussion of the logical, epistemological and metaphysical grounds for African philosophy project.
  • Towa, Marcien. “Conditions for the Affirmation of a Modern African Philosophical Thought”. Tsanay Serequeberhan (ed) African Philosophy: The Essential Readings. New York: Paragon House, 1991.
    • A presentation of important factors required for the emergence of African philosophy as a discipline.
  • Uduigwomen, F. Andrew. “Philosophy and the Place of African Philosophy”. A. F. Uduigwomen ed. From Footmarks to Landmarks on African Philosophy. 1995, 2nd Ed. 1995/2009. Lagos: O. O. P. 2009.
    • A collection of essays on different issues in African philosophy.
  • Uduma Orji. “Can there be an African Logic” in A. F. Uduigwomen(ed.) From Footmarks to Landmarks on African Philosophy Lagos: O. O. P. Ltd, 2009.
    • A critique of a culture-bound logic in African thought.
  • Uduma Orji. “Between Universalism and Cultural Identity: Revisiting the Motivation for an African Logic”. A Paper delivered at an International Conference of the Council for Research in Values and Philosophy Washington D.C., USA at University of Cape  Coast, Cape Coast Ghana 3–5 February, 2010.
    • A critique of a culture-bound logic in African thought and a presentation of logic as universal.
  • Wamba-ia Wamba, E. "Philosophy in Africa: Challenges of the African Philosopher,” in African Philosophy: The Essential Readings. New York: Paragon House, 1991.
    • A discussions of the technical problems of African philosophy as a discipline.
  • Winch, Peter. “Understanding a Primitive Society”. American Philosophical Quarterly. No. 1, 1964.
    • A discussion and a defense of the rationality of primitive people.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi.  Philosophy and an African Culture. Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press, 1980.
    • A discussion of the philosophical elements in an African culture and a call for a universalizable episteme for African philosophy.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi.  “How Not to Compare African Thought with Western Thought.”Ch’Indaba no. 2 ( July–December): 1976.  4–8. Reprinted in African Philosophy: An Introduction, edited by R. Wright. Washington, D.C.: University Press of America, 1977; and in African Philosophy: Selected Readings, edited by Albert G. Mosley. Englewood Cliffs, N.J.: Prentice Hall, 1995.
    • A critique of Robin Horton’s comparison of African and Western thought.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi.“Our Problem of Knowledge: Brief Reflections on Knowledge and Development in Africa”. African Philosophy as Cultural Inquiry. Ivan Karp and D. A. Masolo (ed). Bloomington, Indiana: Indiana University Press, 2000.
    • A discussion on the role of knowledge in the development of Africa.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. Cultural Universals and Particulars: An African Perspective. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1996.
    • A collection of essays on sundry philosophical issues pertaining to comparative and cross-cultural philosophy.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. Conceptual Decolonization in African Philosophy. Ed. Olusegun Oladipo. Ibadan: Hope Publications, 1995.
    • A discussion of the importance and relevance of the theory of conceptual decolonization in African philosophy.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. “On Defining African Philosophy”. C. S. Momoh ed. The Substance of African Philosophy. Auchi: APP Publications, 1989.
    • A discourse on the parameters of the discipline of African philosophy.
  • Wright, Richard A., ed. “Investigating African Philosophy”. African Philosophy: An Introduction. 3rd ed. Lanham, Md.: University Press of America, 1984.
    • A critique of the existence of African philosophy as a discipline.


Author Information

Jonathan O. Chimakonam
University of Calabar

African Sage Philosophy

The Sage Philosophy Project began in the mid-1970s at the Department of Philosophy of the University of Nairobi Kenya. At the University, Henry Odera Oruka (1944-1995) popularized the term “Sage Philosophy Project,” and closely related terms such as “philosophic sagacity,” both by initiating a project of interviewing African sages, and by naming this project in a widely read popular article as the most promising of four trends of the relatively new field of African philosophy.

This encyclopedia article focuses primarily on Oruka and his immediate sources of inspiration, and then includes others whose projects share similar methodologies and goals.

Although the definition of the key terms is not always completely uniform, at the heart of this approach to African philosophy lies the emphasis on academically-trained philosophy students and professors interviewing non-academic wise persons whom Oruka called “sages,” and then engaging philosophically with the interview material. Oruka usually (but not always) emphasized keeping the identity of the individual sage well known.  He also insisted that it was the sage who knew the traditions of his or her ethnic group the best, and who would be able to have critical distance to evaluate and sometimes reject prevailing beliefs and practices. The goals of collecting the interviews and evaluating them have been articulated in Oruka’s many works. The first goal was to help construct texts of indigenous African philosophies. Before Oruka's project there was a dearth of existing texts and a need to record indigenous ideas, both for posterity (that is, for a sense of identity and for historical reasons) and for the present and future. African wisdom that had been marginalized by academia, and by city life, could provide valuable solutions to contemporaneous problems in Africa. Such texts of interviews could also sustain intellectual curiosity and provide practical guidance (or phronesis).

Oruka searched for sages and wanted a wider public to know not only their words (written down in transcripts) but also about their lives.  For him, a sage’s worth was not only in their ideas but also in the way they live: by embodying their philosophies, developing their character, and affecting their communities over the years. After all, the sages in Kenya operate in contexts of social conflict and exploitation. Sages are those from whom others seek moral and metaphysical advice and consultation on issues involving moral and psychological attitudes and judgments.Oruka looked to the term japaro in Luo, meaning “thinker,” to approximate the translation of sage. The term japaro is closely related to jang’ ad rieko which means “professional advisor.” He emphasized that people would single out sages for advice on even the most delicate matters.

Table of Contents

  1. Oruka Biography and Early Writings
  2. Sage Philosophy in Philosophical Context
  3. Beginning Interviews in Kenya
  4. Relationship to the Hallen-Sodipo Study
  5. Folk Sages and Philosophic Sages
  6. Criticisms of Sage Philosophy
  7. Culture Philosophy and Its Relationship to Philosophic Sages
  8. Oruka’s Sage Philosophy: the Last Few Years
  9. Sage Philosophy Research by Other Philosophers: Students
  10. Sage Philosophy Research by Other Philosophers: Other Scholars
  11. References and Further Reading

1. Oruka Biography and Early Writings

The history of the project begins in the 1970s; nevertheless, it is important to understand the project's beginning in the context of its immediate precursors, both those that served as partial models and those that served as negative examples of what must not be done. It is also important to know something about Oruka’s academic training and background, and the skills and interests he brought to the project.

Oruka grew up surrounded by sages in his home area of Ugenya, in the Nyanza Province of Kenya, and as a youth he looked up to them and learned much wisdom from them. Graduating from St. Mary’s High School in Yala, he won a scholarship to study geography at Uppsala University in Sweden. While there, Oruka was influenced by philosophy Professor Ingemar Hedenius to follow his newly developing interests and study philosophy instead. Philosophy studies at Uppsala were divided into two tracks, Practical and Theoretical, and Oruka specialized in Practical Philosophy: Applied Ethics and Political Philosophy. The approach to philosophy Oruka learned both in Sweden and later at Wayne State University in Detroit, Michigan, was greatly influenced by the logical empiricists.  Indeed, Oruka referred to himself an empiricist as well (Practical 283). He would later remark that this narrow emphasis on analytic philosophy that he received in his formal training was an initial “handicap” to his ability to enter the debates on African philosophy upon his return to Kenya (Oruka, Trends 127).

When he returned to Kenya in 1970, Oruka became one of the first two African philosophy faculty members at University of Nairobi. At that time, many departments at the University of Nairobi (UON) were questioning the Eurocentric curriculum that was their colonial heritage. Ngugi wa Thiong’o, Okot p’Bitek, and Taban Lo Liyong were some of the scholars challenging the curriculum in literature, development studies, and other areas (Ogot). The Institute for African Studies at UON was founded in 1970.  Sage philosophy was an attempt to rise to the challenge of imagining an approach to philosophy that focused on African ideas and realities. The fields of literature and history had turned to oral sources; there was no reason that philosophy could not do the same.

When Oruka received his first full-time position in 1970, the field of African Philosophy was dominated by Placide Tempels, John Mbiti, and other early scholars who sometimes blurred the line between religious and philosophical thinking. Also, at that time, the Philosophy and Religious Studies departments at UON were merged. Having studied with Hedenius, famous for his arguments in favor of atheism, Oruka distinguished himself with early essays in 1972 and 1975 denouncing much of what was passing for “African philosophy” as no more than dressed-up mythical thinking. (He later judged these articles as “youthful” as well as “simplistic and unnecessarily offensive” Oruka, Trends 12, n.1; 125-29; Practical 285; Graness and Kresse 12). He championed a secular and logical approach to life’s big questions. However, also impressed by the need to appreciate an unfairly-marginalized, substantial body of thought coming from Africa, Oruka proposed his “sage philosophy” project as a way to provide missing information about African ideas and values. He was convinced that rural sages were not merely “religious figures” but thinkers who used their own rational powers to develop insights, and who could explain their reasoning to others.

In his early 1972 article "Mythologies as African Philosophy" Oruka was to insist on jettisoning traditions harmful to Africa’s present and future. He criticized both Placide Tempels' book Bantu Philosophy and John Mbiti's book African Religions and Philosophy as backward-looking champions of absolutely unphilosophical African traditions. He agreed with Fanon’s criticism of a certain type of misguided African intellectual who falsely builds up the greatness of African tradition in a futile attempt to convince Europeans that African culture is as good as theirs. Oruka wanted instead to write for an African audience (Oruka in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 1999 ed., 23).

In "Mythologies," Oruka began to articulate his emphasis on the need to acknowledge individual thinkers. By anonymizing everyone and providing only group consensus, Tempels, Mbiti, and W. E. Abraham (author of The Mind of Africa) presented “philosophy without philosophers.” He suggested, “We can as well start afresh by interviewing sage Africans and eliciting philosophical expositions from them” (Oruka in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 1999 ed., 30). While individuals’ thinking is influenced by their community and material conditions, they are not determined by them, and in fact individuals can also influence groups. Oruka also pointed out that a philosopher’s role is not just to describe how people think and act, but to make suggestions as to how they ought to think and act (Oruka in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 1999 ed., 31).

2. Sage Philosophy in Philosophical Context

Oruka conceived of the project in relation to interjections from Kwasi Wiredu and Paulin Hountondji, whom he had met and who had both been invited to University of Nairobi. He had become familiar with their written works in early philosophy journals published in Africa, such as Second Order (University of Ife Press, Nigeria), Universitas (Accra), and Cahiers philosophiques africains/African philosophical journal (Zaire) (Oruka, Trends 129-30, 132-33). Both scholars had studied philosophy in African universities and abroad, Wiredu at University College, Oxford, and Hountondji at the École Normale Supérieure, and both were critical of the ethnophilosophical approaches of Tempels and Mbiti.

Wiredu, based in Ghana, emphasized the secular and rational nature of much ethical thought among the Akan groups in Ghana. He outlined three major hindrances to African cultural regeneration: anachronism, authoritarianism, and supernaturalism. But he also insisted that Africa had very wise and philosophical persons from whom a lot could be learned, especially if one paid attention to the nuances of concepts in African languages. In a 1972 issue of Second Order, Wiredu wrote that “it is a particular (though not exclusive) responsibility of African philosophers to research into their traditional background of philosophical thought” ("On an African Orientation" 12). However, he argued, while traditional concepts and codes of conduct should be an area of study, they should not lead to anachronism—an attempt to turn back the hands of time or cling to the days of yesteryear (7).

Wiredu was the first to label “what ‘our elders’ said” as “folk philosophies.” He found exciting the prospect of constructing, from “the living wise men of the tribe,” “the elaborate and argumentative reasons” behind the belief systems and moral guidelines of “our philosophers of old.”  Still, the resulting material could not, Wiredu believed, help to tackle most modern problems in Africa ("On an African Orientation" 5). Along with interest in past traditions, he maintained, scientific method and clear argumentation were necessary to guide African youths in confronting the new moral dilemmas facing contemporary African society. Barry Hallen, scrutinizing Wiredu’s article, says that Wiredu intended the phrase “folk philosophies” to refer to unreasoned beliefs whether they were African or Western (Hallen "Yoruba" 106-08). Wiredu followed up this exploration with an article that Oruka recommended to his readers, in which Wiredu compared and contrasted the meaning of “philosopher” and “wise man.” The material, first published in the article (Wiredu "What Is"), was later incorporated in Wiredu’s book (Wiredu Philosophy 139-173; see Oruka Trends 69n5).

Three years later (1975), in Second Order, Oruka explained that he and others at UON were already engaged in a project along the lines of Wiredu’s description. He said, “We are seeking to unsheathe, through constant contacts and discussions with those concerned, the elaborate philosophical views and reasons from the living traditional Kenyan thinkers and sages” (Oruka "The Fundamental" 54n6). He followed Wiredu’s words and ideas closely enough to repeat the descriptors “elaborate” and “reasons.” In his subsequent book he adopted the descriptors “folk philosophies” and “folk sage,” but clarified that, in addition to elders who are examples of folk sagacity, there were some philosophic sages able to scrutinize prevailing beliefs and give sustained arguments for their positions. The elders, he asserted, were more than just depositories of outdated folk wisdom. Philosophical sages were able both to describe the “culture philosophy” held by most members of their community and also to evaluate the content (or at least understand the genesis) of such culture philosophies.  In Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) Wiredu affirmed that “The recording and critical study of the thought of individual indigenous thinkers is worthy of the most serious attention of contemporary African philosophers” (37). In Cultural Universals and Particulars (1996), Wiredu wrote that Oruka’s sage philosophy book was the first to give “substantial notice” to individual philosophical thinkers in Africa (116).

Paulin Hountondji was another key influence on the development of sage philosophy. Hountondji gave a talk, "Philosophy and Its Revolutions," at the National University of Zaire during “Special Philosophy Days" in June 1973, and a second time at University of Nairobi in November, 1973.  Invitations for these talks came from the Philosophical Association of Kenya, which Oruka had founded (African 71).A paper based on the talks was published in French in 1973 in Cahiers philosophiques africains/African Philosophical Journal and later incorporated into Hountondji's book, African Philosophy: Myth and Reality (71-108). Hountondji’s “Revolution” article, and chapter, which Oruka and other Kenyans heard in person in 1973, criticized Tempels’ book Bantu Philosophy but appreciated the works of two European anthropologists, Paul Radin and Marcel Griaule, suggesting that their approach was much more careful than Tempels'. In fact, Hountondji said, Tempels’ study was “behind the anthropology of the time” (African 76). Twenty years earlier than Tempels, Radin wrote Primitive Man as Philosopher, a study of philosophy in Africa that focused on original thinkers who were members of an intellectual class in their communities. Hountoundji explained that Radin denounced the prejudice that African individuals are submerged in unitary group-think and took it upon himself to transcribe faithfully what members of this intellectual class told him (African 76; “La Philosophie” 30-31).

Paul Radin was an anthropologist originally from Poland who had studied with Franz Boas at Columbia University. Radin recorded interviews with members of a Native American community from Nebraska called the Winnebago. He explained in his book the necessity of researchers presenting “statements made by the Winnebago” word-for-word to the public, rather than merely recounting others’ ideas in ways that mixed the researcher’s interpretation with the words and views of those interviewed (64). Researchers who thought they did readers a service, by weaving together narratives and accounts of multiple informants in a harmonizing way, actually hid the extent of disagreement and diversity of opinion in the community (xxxviii).. Since primary sources are so valuable, Radin advocated a method of careful direct questioning, a process which under the best circumstances “can become something analogous to a true philosophical dialogue” (xxxi). Radin first published his book in 1927 but came out with a second edition in 1957 which critiqued Placide Tempels’ approach as presumptive and wrong-headed insofar as Tempels presumed to describe Bantu philosophy on behalf of Bantu speaking people, instead of letting them speak for themselves.

Hountondji stated that “Radin’s work is still, to the best of my knowledge, the most lucid ethnological critique of the theoretical assumptions of ethnophilosophy” (African 79). He praised Radin for showing the level of variations in retellings of particular myths and the ways each narrator influenced the myth in their own way, thus demonstrating the “profound individualism” among African intellectuals. Though he faulted Radin for use of the insulting word “primitive,” Hountondji was struck by how, unlike other Western anthropologists, Radin conveyed Africa as a place with views as plural as those of Western societies (African 79). While Radin’s study predated Oruka’s coining of the term “sage philosophy,” certainly Radin’s project shared much in common (both in goals and method) with Oruka’s later project. While Radin’s own first-hand research was with the Winnebago tribe (now more accurately called the Ho-Chunk people) in North America, Radin’s book drew upon primary source narratives of philosophical thought from various communities around the world, including proverbs and poems from Africa.

John Dewey, who wrote the foreword to Radin’s book, thanked Radin for challenging certain common misconceptions of Africa, which tended to present Africans as accepting “automatic moral standards” based on custom, when in fact African communities respected freedom of expression and emphasized individual moral responsibility (Radin xix). The relationship and consistency between Radin’s approach and that of Oruka’s sage philosophy project was alluded to by Kai Kresse (27-28), Lucius Outlaw (in Oruka Sage 244n27), and Godwin Azenabor (73).

While Oruka probably heard about Radin in Hountondji’s 1973 presentation in Nairobi, Oruka nowhere credited Radin as an inspiration for his own chosen methods. In fact, Oruka engaged in a lifelong castigation of anthropologists, condemning them along with missionaries like Tempels. Oruka presumed that all anthropologists anonymized and conglomerated their sources into one, and he asserted that no anthropologist had devised a method similar to his own. Another important distinction to highlight is that Radin made extensive use of proverbs, poems, and songs, which he considered primary sources even if the specific authors were unknown, and found profound philosophical thought in these sources. Many in the field of African philosophy have also argued for using these kinds of sources as philosophical sources, for example, Kwame Gyekye of Ghana (An Essay 8-19) and Claude Sumner, a Canadian who researched Ethiopian philosophy for many years, and Ethiopian philosopher Workineh Kelbessa (“Logic"; Indigenous chap. 11). Even Oruka’s philosophy colleague at UON, Gerald Wanjohi, engaged in extensive analysis of proverbs (Wanjohi Wisdom). Oruka did not consider the study of proverbs to be related to his project. He narrowly focused on interviews with living sages as his only source, despite the fact that other contemporaries of his argued that one could find clear expression of logical argument as well as insightful reflection in proverbs (Sumner 22-23, 391-403). In an article he wrote on Sumner, Oruka mentioned that Sumner spent much effort studying and publishing Oromo proverbs (Practical 156), and maintained that studying proverbs is a different method than ethnophilosophy, but he did not develop these ideas. In Sage Philosophy (1990 ed. 115-16; 1991 ed. 117), the sage Simiyu Chaungo discussed the use of proverbs, but it is the only time proverbs are mentioned in the book.

Along with Radin, Hountonji’s 1973 article also included Marcel Griaule as an example of anthropologists whose methods differed from Tempels' (31). Griaule interviewed Ogotemmeli, a Dogon elder in Mali, at length. Hountondji was disappointed that certain political factions inside and outside of Africa preferred Tempels’ style of massive, definitive synthesis of all Bantu views to capturing the plurality and disorderliness of individual thought by direct interview. In the preface to the second edition of his book, which included “Philosophy and Its Revolutions," Hountondji again reiterated his 1974 opinion of Griaule as an important trend-setter:

The French anthropologist had chosen to transcribe the words of one sage among many. He showed the possibility of a long term project which would consist of a systematic transcription of such speeches, at least as a starting point of a critical discussion—what my Kenyan colleague the late Odera Oruka would later call “philosophical sagacity”—rather than as reconstruction of implicit philosophy behind the habits and customs of the host society through a lot of non-verifiable hypotheses which always amount to over-interpreting the facts”(ix).

In 1996, Hountondji saw Griaule’s project as an earlier version of Oruka’s project. He reiterated his estimation of Griaule in his reflections, published in English as The Struggle for Meaning (2002). In this work he reflected on his views back in 1970, saying of Griaule’s work:  “Voluntarily assigning to himself the humble task of a secretary, custodian, transcriber of the worldview of a black sage, of one spiritual master among others, the French ethnologist gave the example of scientific patience and, in my eyes, did more useful work than the ethnophilosophers proper who were in a hurry to reach definitive conclusions on African philosophy in general” (99).

Oruka himself was not that impressed with Griaule and Ogotommeli. In his 1983 article in International Philosophical Quarterly, later included in Sage Philosophy, Oruka argued that Ogotemmeli was at best a “folk sage” and not a philosophical sage, because he did not transcend his group’s views. Therefore, Griaule was not engaged in sage philosophy, but only in “culture philosophy” (Oruka Sage, 1991 ed., 34, 47, 49-50).

Hountondji and Oruka both missed research published by other anthropologists in the 1960s that cast doubt on whether Griaule really followed his professed method of interviewing one person and transcribing what that person said. D. A. Masolo made a thorough review of the anthropological literature on Griaule, most but not all of it in French, in which the authors questioned whether the conversation was recorded verbatim on the series of days that Griaule recounted. They suspected Griaule of reconstructing the conversation (Masolo African 69, 77, 260). Jack Goody’s book review discussed the painstaking detail an interview must have in order to meet standards of even a “soft” science like anthropology. The words of the person interviewed should be clearly demarcated from those that are the author's commentary. Field notes should be identified as such and distinguished from the words of the on-site translator. Original language transcriptions should be available, and the difficulty of translating esoteric words should be discussed by the author. Griaule’s book did not meet these standards (Goody review). Kibujjo Kalumba, who considered Griaule’s book on Ogotommeli one of three possible sources of sage philosophy, complained that the book contained too much of Griaule’s re-wording of Ogotommeli’s ideas (274, 276).

While Oruka declared in 1972 his intent to interview wise elders, he had just the previous year been quite critical of another philosopher’s use of the interview method applied to the topic of Ethics. Tore Nordenstam, a Norwegian based in Khartoum, Sudan, had interviewed three of his students, and on the basis of the interviews, published a book called Sudanese Ethics. In his rather harshly critical review of the book, Oruka questioned how interviews could be helpful at all in the study of ethics.

Oruka himself changed from someone with antipathy toward Nordenstam’s project to a person who promoted a large project interviewing African sages. His own project tried to avoid all of the pitfalls he pointed out in Nordenstam’s project: he did not interview students; he tried to interview those without exposure to studies in European philosophy; he addressed gender issues in most of his interviews; and he asked his interviewees sensitive political questions, even at great risk to himself (as in his interviews with Oginga Odinga). He shared with Nordenstam the focus on ethical issues. Before leaving this section on early precursors and influences on sage philosophy, it is important to note that a Kenyan scholar wrote an article in 1959 that is considered by several African philosophy scholars to be a clear precedent to sage philosophy. Taaita Towett (d. 2007) is known these days mostly for his role in Kenyan education and politics. As Minister of Education, he was “Patron” of the Philosophical Association of Kenya (see Thought and Practice 1.2 [1974] inside back cover). Towett's 1959 article, translated into French as “Le Role d’un philosophie Africain,” “earlier expressed an identical argument” to Oruka’s, according to Ochieng’-Odhaimbo ("The Tripartite" 30n4). In the PhD thesis he wrote under Oruka’s supervision (later excerpted in Sage Philosophy) and in a 1983 journal article, Anthony Oseghare claimed that Towett’s 1959 article provided “evidence of the existence of critical philosophical reasoning in Africa” (Oseghare "Sagacity" 95; Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 237). D. A. Masolo noted that Towett, as Oruka did later, argued that literacy was not a prerequisite for philosophizing and that Socrates was an example of an oral philosopher. Towett and Oruka both contended that “there must have been African philosophers engaged in the formulation of culture philosophy” (Masolo African Philosophy 236).

3. Beginning Interviews in Kenya

In his published works, Oruka explained that he began his sage philosophy project along with his philosophy colleague Joseph Donders, a White Father from the Netherlands ("The Fundamental" 54n6; Sage 1991 ed., 17-18). Donders explained that the funds for the study were originally received from the UON’s Dean’s Committee ("Don't Fence" 11).

Oruka’s early publications describing his projects and his methods began in the mid-1970s.  At the time, Oruka made it clear that his project was a national one, and was to include wise sages from a wide variety of ethnic groups in Kenya. At this time, there was a lot of focus on building up Kenya’s national identity, and Oruka wanted his project to be a unifier for the country, where all Kenyans could take pride in a common heritage of wise philosophers. He also wanted Kenyans to evaluate and be able to justify their cultural practices (see Oruka "Philosophy"; Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends, 116-117; Presbey “Attempts”). At the same time, Oruka focused on sages who could articulate reasons for their philosophical and ethical positions that did not rely on mere tradition or on religious authority. He also focused on the individual identities and arguments of the sages rather than melding the ideas of individuals into the “group think” of an ethnic group; to do the latter would have been to engage in the common error in African studies in philosophy.

As F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo has noted, the exact terminology for Oruka’s project has changed over time. In 1974, when Oruka first announced his project, he called it “Thoughts on Traditional Kenyan Sages.” He first coined the term “philosophic sagacity” in 1978, referring to individual critical and reflective sages engaging in thought in such a way that even European or analytic philosophers would have to admit that philosophers were present in Africa. He created and emphasized the approach as an alternative to ethnophilosophy, which he disparaged. Ochieng’-Odhiambo noted that as early as 1983, Oruka called those engaged in philosophic sagacity “sage philosophers.” He contrasted them to ordinary sages (later called “folk sages”) who, in 1983, were not considered philosophical because they lacked critical reflection and ability to create independent positions on topics. In 1984, in “Philosophy in English Speaking Africa,” Oruka used the term “sage philosophy.” At first, the two terms “philosophic sagacity” and “sage philosophy” were used interchangeably and no distinctions were drawn. But during this third stage of Oruka’s works (1984–1995), he used the term “philosophic sagacity” increasingly less, while he used “sage philosophy” increasingly more. Oruka then used the term “sage philosophy” retrospectively to refer to his pre-1984 works (Ochieng’-Odhaimbo, "The Evolution" 19, 24).

The term “philosophic sagacity” Ochieng’-Odhiambo says, was first presented in Oruka’s “Four Trends in African Philosophy” at a conference on Dr. William Amo in Accra, Ghana, in July,  1978 (Oruka Trends 21n1; also see Ochieng’-Odhaimbo "Philosophic Sagacity: Aims"). "Four Trends" was later revised and presented at the World Congress of Philosophy conference in Dusseldorf, Germany, in August, 1978 (Ochieng’-Odhiambo "The Evolution" 22, 30n6). However a Nigerian philosopher, M. Akin Makinde, commenting on Oruka’s popularization of the term, claimed to be the originator of the term in the context of African philosophy. Makinde said he used the term “philosophic sagacity” (with a different connotation than Oruka) earlier than Oruka in a conference paper he presented in June, 1978, at University of Ife (Makinde “Robin"; “Philosophy" 107). Makinde’s 1978 paper drew upon concepts in Bombastus Paracelsus’ essay Philosophia Sagax. Collins English Dictionary explains that “philosophic” is a term created in Middle English around 1350-1400 C.E. that meant “learned, pertaining to alchemy.” Makinde claimed that Oruka used the term and concept “wrongly” but admitted that Oruka’s usage became the more widespread (African 9, 122, 137). Many scholars in African philosophy do not pay attention to the term “philosophic” and refer to Oruka’s method as “philosophical sagacity” (for example see Hallen African 68-75; Imbo 25-26).

Oruka articulated his project and his methods in the context of growing debates on the topic of African philosophy. He spearheaded the founding of the Philosophical Association of Kenya and the creation of its journal, Thought and Practice, in 1974. In his famous “Four Trends” article, he divided African Philosophy into four diverse interests/trends with differing methodologies (ethno-, nationalist-ideological, and professional philosophies including his own, philosophic sagacity).  At these venues and in publications he explained how his own project was not just another example of the wrong-headed “ethnophilosophy” approach (criticized by Paulin Hountondji) but was instead an alternative to it.

In a 1988 article of Oruka’s first published in German and later included in English in Trends (50-69), Oruka described his sage philosophy project, listed eight sages (all men) who were part of his study, and gave a biography of each. Two of them, Paul Mbuya Akoko (d. 1981) and Oruka Rang'inya (d. 1979), would be included at greater length in his soon-to-be-released, book-length study of sage philosophy. The others mentioned in 1988 had only biographies and short excerpts of their interviews in the German-language article, which were repeated in two books.  These latter sages were Njeru wa Kanuenje, Nyaga wa Mauch, Arap Baliach, Muganda Okwako (d. 1979), Joash Walumoli, and Kasina Wa Ndoo (Trends 57-61, 66-67; Sage 1991 ed., 37-40).  Oruka explained that he and researcher Jesse N.K. Mugambi interviewed Njeru wa Kanyenje of Embu district together, in the Embu language (Trends 66, 132).

Oruka’s book Sage Philosophy was published first by Brill in 1990 and later in Nairobi in 1991. There are a few differences between the two publications, but most changes are minor editorial ones, with the major exception that chapter one of the Brill edition has an extra twelve pages telling the background of the study. The book has three parts. The first is Oruka’s introduction to his project. Here, Oruka gathered (with little revision) several of his articles on sage philosophy that had been published over the years. The second part includes interviews with sages, and the third part includes commentators and critics. Documentation of the sages as individuals, and the publication of their originally oral philosophical thoughts, are crucial to Oruka’s methodology; this stands in contrast to ethnophilosophy’s practice of summarizing what informants (often anonymous) say and searching for a common denominator. Also in the second part, a brief biographical sketch and photograph precedes each interview. Oruka insisted on identifying both folk and philosophic sages in the same manner. In this way, his project does not merely repeat the same ground covered by ethnophilosophy.

The book minimizes the editorial/interpretive role of the professional philosopher, in comparison to other anthropological approaches, by including direct excerpts from interviews of sages who were self-conscious of their role as cultural critics and were respected for the critical views they articulated. Interviews with sages covered topics related to philosophy of religion (such as the existence of God, life after death, and so forth), free will and determinism, and ethics. These topics were of central concern to Oruka, whose own academic background from Uppsala was in practical philosophy rather than theoretical philosophy. Oruka mentioned “Chaungo Barasa, Fred Ochieng’-Odhiambo, Sam Oluoch Imbo, Samuel Wanjohi Kimiti and Mwangi Samuel Chege” as his key research assistants in the project (Sage 1991 ed., xi).

Oruka closely followed this first book-length publication with a monograph focusing on the interviews of Jaramogi Oginga Odinga. He explained that for the 1982 interviews he was accompanied by E. S. Atieno-Odhiambo, a well-known Kenyan historian who focuses on oral history, and in 1992 Chaungo Barasa assisted him. Odera Oruka provided his own commentary on the interviews, which focused on Odinga’s love of truth, and how Odinga’s commitment to truth and love of the masses contrasted with Plato’s own position in the Republic regarding the myth of metals, sometimes called the “noble lie” (Oginga Odinga xi, 3-4, 12-13).

4. Relationship to the Hallen-Sodipo Study

Barry Hallen and J. Olubi Sodipo engaged in a research project that involved interviewing wise men among the Yoruba in Nigeria. They began their project around the same time as Oruka, in 1973-74.  As Hallen and Sodipo explain, they started in 1973 with a non-credit student study group at the University of Lagos. During university breaks they asked students to “establish face-to-face fieldwork relationships with the elders and wise men of their family compounds, villages, and towns” (Hallen and Sodipo 9). They chose the concept of the person as the theme for these first discussions. After this first study, they interviewed people in the Ekiti region from 1974-84 and moved the project to the University of Ife (now Obafemi Awolowo University) in 1975 (Hallen and Sodipo xvi, 11). Sodipo became head of the newly independent philosophy department that separated from the religious studies department in 1975.

Hallen and Sodipo chose to study herbalists and native doctors because they were more critically sophisticated than the “ordinary persons” whom they advised, and were able to offer theoretical concepts (10-11).  They explained that the onisegun (Yoruba wise men) they interviewed were organized into their own professional society called an egbe, with rules, evaluations, possible reprimands, and a pledge of secrecy. The onisegun were not mere masters of medicine, but rather, they “[gave] advice and counsel about business dealings, family problems, unhappy personal situations, religious problems, and the future, as well as about physical and mental illness” (13).  They did not name their individual interlocutors because, as they explained, those they interviewed requested to remain anonymous (14). They acknowledged that the practical questions regarding interviewing methods were many, and they tried to sort out the question: “is each man to be treated as an individual, potentially eccentric thinker, or are opinions to be somehow collated and presented as shared and communal?" (8). They followed the latter plan, due to the fact that they were studying language use. Their study had philosophical insights regarding how the use of words “knowledge” and “belief” were understood, and came to note that among the Yoruba, the use of the term translated as “knowledge” is much narrower than the usage in Britain or the United States, because it was reserved for first-hand knowledge alone. In Britain or the U.S., people commonly claimed to know a vast amount of information (in the form of propositions) that went beyond their first-hand knowledge (see Hallen and Sodipo; Hallen "Yoruba").

Because it involved academic philosophers interviewing wise elders in Africa, many people associated the Hallen and Sodipo project with Oruka’s sage philosophy project. However, at least in some of his writings, Oruka clarified that he did not consider their work that of sage philosophy due to its lack of emphasis on individual sages. In fact, Oruka complained that it looked like the onisegun of the study held views “in consensus” and therefore to study their views was “anthropology, not philosophy” (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 8-10; quote, 10), or even “culture philosophy,” “cultural prejudices” or “philosophication” (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 50). “Philosophication” is a term that Oruka intended to have a derogatory tone. At one point he defined it as “the discovery of a philosophy out of no philosophy;” he also played with coining the word “philosofolkation” which involved loving the “folk” so much that one invented a philosophy for them and made oneself its spokesperson (1990b, 7). Oruka’s criticisms began as early as his 1975 article, when he charged J. O. Sodipo with trying to pass off African superstitions regarding the agency of the Yoruba gods as an African understanding of cause and, hence, philosophical (Oruka "The Fundamental" 48). In a more conciliatory tone, he wrote in his 1983 article that the Hallen-Sodipo project, like Griaule’s Ogotemmeli, while not “philosophic sagacity,” may be “some form of sagacity” (Oruka "Sagacity" 389; Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends 133).

On this point, Ochieng’-Odhiambo pointed out ("The Evolution" 27) that a particular end note in an article of Oruka’s 1990 book, Trends in Contemporary African Philosophy (Oruka Trends 68), suggested that Hallen and Sodipo’s project might be part of sage philosophy, despite Oruka’s clarification in other works (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 8-9, 50) that it was not. This endnote is a bit indirect. Oruka listed Hallen and Sodipo’s works along with several others that directly address sage philosophy, and then added the caveat, “It is not the case that every one of these writings addresses itself to the direct question of Sage philosophy. But they all make special reference to a type of thinking in Africa that can only owe its existence to the thoughts of some wise men (and women) in traditional Africa.” This statement makes it sound like Hallen and Sodipo were fellow travelers. Interestingly enough, Oruka mentioned that at a certain point in his research he interviewed some sages who wanted their names withheld (Sage 1991 ed., 65n4), and he mentioned specifically a parallel with Hallen and Sodipo’s study.

In his 2006 book, African Philosophy: The Analytic Approach, Hallen agreed that it was best to keep his own project and Oruka’s separate. As good grounds for separating them, Hallen explained that his and Sodipo’s project was always intended to be an exercise in philosophy of language, and he admitted that such was not the case with Oruka’s interviews. He also acknowledged that Oruka wanted to keep them separate (4–5). But he also explained, in Knowledge, Belief, and Witchcraft, that he thought that the kinds of description of their project that Oruka engaged in were unkind and unfair. Oruka did not take into account that when one does philosophy of language one cannot help but search for common usages of terms and concepts. Hallen recounted in an afterword to the 1997 edition of Knowledge, Belief, and Witchcraft the shock he experienced upon first reading criticisms of their work such as this. He and Sodipo had been bracing for criticisms from anthropologists; they expected to be told that they weren’t properly trained to do fieldwork. But they were surprised to find themselves criticized by philosophers for advocating a communal consensus account of African thought, basically being accused of the dreaded “ethnophilosophy” as Hountondji had described it.

Hallen asked Hountodji and Oruka to rethink their criticism, since there was no way to practice ordinary language philosophical analysis, whether in Africa, England, or elsewhere, without focusing on common meanings. Hallen thought that the fact that their study was able to debunk many prevailing myths and stereotypes about Africa, including misconceptions made popular by some anthropologists that considered African thought as pre-reflective, uncritical, traditional, emotional, and non-reasonable. This was evidence that they should be appreciated, not lumped in with anthropologists and ethnophilosophers whose projects were evaluated negatively (Hallen and Sodipo 136-37n16; 140). Indeed, one of the surprising conclusions of Hallen and Sodipo’s study was that the onisegun had such stringent criteria for counting something as knowledge (that is, restricting it to first-hand experience, and requiring careful reporting and testimony from all witnesses), that they made Euro-Americans who accept second-hand propositional knowledge as true seem “dangerously naïve or perhaps even ignorant” in comparison to the onisegun (Hallen Yoruba 299).

While discussing parallels in Nigeria, it is important to note that Campbell S. Momoh (d. 2006) engaged in interviews with elders of the Uchi community.  Momoh says he responded to Hallen’s call for philosophers to go to villages to discuss philosophical topics with illiterate elders (Momoh "African" 99). He cited as his intellectual sources for the methodology of the project not Oruka but instead both Paul Radin and William Abraham. In his 1962 book, Abraham distinguished public philosophy from private philosophy, referring to Griaule’s study of Ogotommeli as an example of “of an individual African philosopher rather than a repository of the public philosophy” (104). Momoh saw a commonality between Radin’s notion of the African intellectual and what Abraham called “private philosophy” (Momoh The Substance 53, 55). Momoh insisted that interviewees should be named and credited.

Momoh was himself involved in interviewing elder sages. He did his dissertation fieldwork in 1978 and submitted his dissertation in 1979 to Indiana University. His dissertation committee included William Abraham and Ivan Karp (An African Conception).  The dissertation includes lengthy sections naming elder interlocutors (such as Aliu Oshiothenaua, Saliu Ikharo and others), paraphrasing their conversation in detail as well as quoting them directly (92-120). Momoh also provides contextual background of the sages’ standing and purpose in their communities (see especially 45-48, 67-70, 85-87). He even mentions seeming interruptions in the discussion, such as the presence of a young boy or a chicken, and how the conversation is shaped by these interactions (something for the most part missing from the interviews in Oruka’s study). Topics focus on metaphysics and ethics. Along with accounts of the elders’ discussions, Momoh includes his interpretation and analysis of what the elders say. While the elders may convey their ideas in story and myths, these do not just reflect communal philosophies since some of the stories are creations of individual men (for example, Ikharo’s story of woman’s refusal to accept marrying man as her God-given duty and role, see 116-117).

In his published work, Momoh names some elders, quotes them verbatim, and gives specific examples of methodological challenges during his interview of them ("African Philosophy" 87-88).  He named Aliu Oshiothenaua, Pa Egbue, Pa Abudah (Momoh’s uncle), and a hunter named A. M. J. Momoh (The Substance 66, 245, 254-55, 376-78). He found in the interview of the hunter a “doctrine of existential gratitude” (The Substance 382). Oshiothenaua asserted a theory of human dependence on nature (The Substance 376). An ethnophilosophical study that merely explored communally held beliefs in the sense of Abraham’s “public philosophy” would be incomplete, Momoh insisted, because “alongside with it” it would need to name individual intellectuals and add additional contextual information such as the time period, cultural paradigm, and branch of philosophy relevant to the discussions. He criticized Bodunrin, who wanted to make an “absolute dichotomy” between ethnophilosophy and the sagacious elders, since, according to Momoh, the latter were based on the former–that is, the “sagacious elders” philosophized in a general context provided by public philosophy ("African" 77-78, 80-81; The Substance 56, 58, 59).

Momoh also insisted that sagacious elders had a better practice than much of contemporary analytic academic philosophy, since their goal was not the narrow one of negatively appraising received ideas, but the broader project of building holistic systems and attending to important moral issues ("African Philosophy" 91; The Substance 69, 75, 78). While Oruka notes that in Momoh’s earlier 1985 article Momoh seemed unaware of Oruka’s sage philosophy project (Oruka, Sage 1990 ed., xxiv) and castigated Oruka as a member of the “African logical neo-positivists” who denigrated ancient African philosophy (Momoh based this estimate on Oruka’s 1972 article critical of myth, see The Substance 64), he later revised his estimate of Oruka and acknowledged his sage philosophy project (The Substance x). In an article originally published in 1987 (included in Sage 1990 ed.), Oruka expressed his agreement with C. S. Momoh’s position that the names of sages interviewed must be given and their views credited to them (Sage 1990 ed., 20). Fayemi Ademola Kazeem considered Momoh to be engaging in a sage philosophy project as was Oruka, noting that Momoh preferred to call it “ancient African philosophy” (Kazeem 196).

Godwin Azenabor included Hallen and Sodipo, Momoh, Oruka and others in a common category of African philosophy which he called the “Purist school” because all were committed to the assertions that Africa has a similar practice of raising philosophical questions and answering them as does the West; however they all saw the need to break free of Western paradigms, conceptual schemes, and conditioning. All in the Purist School emphasized the relevance of African culture and tradition for both philosophy as well as models for African development (Azenabor Understanding xiv). While the choice of “Purist” as a descriptor can be questioned (see Sophie Oluwole’s defense of Oruka’s project as admitting up front the multiple influences on contemporary rural sages, in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 155), Azenabor’s categorization helps us to see the common themes and approaches of authors who emphasized their distinction from and competition with each other.

5. Folk Sages and Philosophic Sages

In some works Oruka was at pains to distinguish “folk sages” and “folk sagacity” (wise elders who could recount community traditions and beliefs but not take a critical, evaluative stance toward them) from “philosophical sages” or “philosophic sagacity” which were the interviews and ideas of particularly reflective and evaluative sages. The distinction copied “first order” and “second order” distinctions in philosophy to a great extent. Many philosophers concluded that the only important part of the sage philosophy project was the “philosophic sagacity” part. However, such an approach left unexplained the role that folk sages played in the project. Why continue to include folk sages if they are examples of unphilosophical individuals? Several scholars addressed this thorny topic (Presbey “Sage Philosophy: Criteria"; Van Hook).

Omedi Ochieng noted the irony that while Oruka first began his project to debunk Western scoffers who thought Africans were involved in unreflective groupthink, his comments championing the philosophic sages as “geniuses” in contrast to folk sages and other Africans who were satisfied at following others and not thinking for themselves ended up reinforcing the negative stereotype of Africans (“Epistemology” 348-351). He thought that Oruka capitulated and accepted academic definitions of philosophy that belittled folk wisdom and championed abstraction in a way that silenced the important contributions of many Africans (“Ideology” 153-57). Oluwole likewise noted that in some of Oruka’s texts he seemed to define “philosophy” so narrowly that even his own sages would fail to meet such narrow criteria, which would ironically lead to the failure of his own project. She insists, however, that if the sage interviews could be approached by sensitive scholars familiar with the sages’ language and context, without the near-ubiquitous prejudice against finding philosophy in African oral practices, that the project in this sense is very promising (Oluwole in Graness and Kresse 158-61).

An additional problem is that even when Oruka sorted out his folk and philosophical sages, the folk sages still demonstrated the intellectual virtues Oruka insisted belonged only to the philosophical sages. To illustrate this point, let me highlight that each of the seven “folk sages” in Sage Philosophy (chap. 6) distinguished their views from those of their communities on at least one topic. Chege Kamau said that he didn’t believe the afterlife consists in ancestral spirits as others believe. Rather, he posited, all people rejoin one big soul, which he called God. Joseph Muthee advocated sometimes unpopular inter-tribal marriages as a means of building a national culture. Ali Mwitani Masero argued that death is the end of the human being. Zacharia Nyandere said he believed men and women were equal, despite Luo perceptions to the contrary. Abel M’Nkabui said all humans were equal, and that inequalities were historical accidents. Based on this conviction, he was critical of Meru prejudice against blacksmiths. Joseph Osuru said that the Teso think that God does not belong to other tribes or races. But he thought that God belongs to all people. He also mentioned that some Teso think that having dreams of the deceased is proof that they live in a world after death. But, he pointed out, having a dream is not proof. Peris Njuhi Muthoni said that it was good that the practice of female circumcision is dying, because it led to medical problems. She stated that it was her conviction that Luo should not remove their teeth as a rite of passage. These concrete examples show that all of the so-called “folk sages” can critique their own societies, an attribute Oruka assigned only to the “philosophic sages.”

Oruka listed “philosophic sages” in their own chapter (chap. 7). The sages included there were Okemba Simiuyu Chaungo, Oruka Rang’inya, Stephen M. Kithanje, Paul Mbuya Akoko, and Chaungo Barasa (Sage 1991 ed., 109-155). An additional aspect of the sage philosophy project was that Oruka did not want the project to stay on the descriptive level. He wanted Kenyans to read and grapple with the ideas of the sages, evaluate them, extend them, and apply them to their lives. However, his own published commentary on the interviews was brief (Trends 64-65). In Sage Philosophy, he left the job of commentary on the interviews to his student, Anthony Oseghare (Sage 1991 ed., 156-160).

D. A. Masolo made the point that it is not mere disagreement with one’s cultural group that makes one a philosophic sage, but rather that “the criterion for a moral ideal, according to the sage, is not that it match the historical belief of the community but that it satisfies an acceptable idea of right, fairness, and respectfulness toward all those who are involved or may be affected by its practical application” (Masolo "Sage"). He gave the example of a sage who would counsel against the practice of a certain ritual if it would jeopardize the health of an individual. In these circumstances, the important criteria “was not their mere variance from the communal beliefs of the sages' own groups but also a theoretical account provided by the sage as the foundation of his or her own view. . . The sage attends to the rationality of views rather than to the judgment of the group” (Masolo "Sage").

One of the tensions found within sage philosophy is that, while Oruka privileged sages critical of their societies’ prejudices, as in the examples above, on the other hand he championed sages who hold in high esteem traditional values forgotten or marginalized by young Kenyans.  In a 1979 research proposal for sage philosophy, he explained that his project was a way of defending his nation from the “invasion by foreign ideas,” which could not be stopped by guns but instead must be combated on the level of ideas. This cultural invasion included worship of technology and an adherence to crass materialism as a measure of success. Oruka bemoaned the fact that African traditional morality was already eroded by European colonialism, and their replacements, Christianity and Islam, he argued, were incapable of standing up to the cultural erosion of values ("The Philosophical").

Oruka often asked questions about the proper relationship between men and women during his interviews with sages. Many of the sages insisted that women were inferior to men. Oruka cautioned readers that the sages were reflecting the cultural prejudices of their times, and he reminded those familiar with Western philosophy that such assertions of women’s inferiority could be found as well throughout the Western canon of well-known and respected philosophers. Still, he was proud of the fact that some of his sages held relatively progressive views on this topic (Sage 1990 ed., xix-xx; Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends, 136), and he even had one sage’s views on the topic published in a Nairobi newspaper (“Paul Mbuya"). The views asserting men’s superiority could be found in the sages interviewed by his student F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo and Ngungi Kathanga. In Oruka’s studies as well as his students’ studies, few women sages were interviewed. Gail Presbey has drawn attention to women sages in her works ("Who"; "Kenyan").

6. Criticisms of Sage Philosophy

From early on, critics from within the community of African philosophy scholars put forward their criticisms. Oruka included three critics (Bodunrin, Kaphagawani, and Keita) and three supporters (Outlaw, Oseghare, and Neugebauer) in Sage Philosophy. Peter Bondunrin said Oruka’s sages were not enough like the Greek philosophers, who expounded their view in a context of literacy (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 163-179, esp. 168-69). Lansana Keita said that when Oruka relegated creative individual thinking to the critical views of “philosophic sagacity,” he failed to acknowledge that the folk or ethnophilosophy of the community could itself be a product of earlier creative individual philosophizing (Sage 1990 ed., 210). While some of these criticisms were perhaps based on a misunderstanding of Oruka’s project (see Bewaji review 109), Oruka did appreciate the debates that ensued and responded to these critics in his own articles, which were included in the first part of the book.

After the publication of the book, criticism continued. D. A. Masolo said the sages Oruka quoted often made comments that were no more than common sense, perhaps with some cleverness thrown in, rather than sustained arguments (Masolo African Philosophy 236-245).  Ochieng’-Odhiambo had a clever and insightful response to this kind of criticism. “The idea that philosophy must always operate at a higher rarefied level with deep abstractions is not always true . . . Philosophy can, in many ways, be expressed very simply”; in fact, he agreed with Christopher Nwondo, who advocated that philosophers in Africa should attempt to write in clear and simple language (Trends 138). But Ochieng’-Odhiambo did clarify that Masolo was not against the sage philosophy project itself, but had just stated that he thought the interviews included were not yet strong enough to prove the point to his liking (Trends 137).

Tunde Bewaji reviewed Sage Philosophy and was impressed by Oruka’s sage interviews because they “reflect a clarity of thought which is not seen in ethnographic, anthropological or sociological studies” (106). While Simiyu Chaungo argued that God was the sun, because without the sun there could be no life, Ali Mwitani Masero, on page 96 of Sage Philosophy, argued that if God created the sun, God cannot also be the sun. Bewaji also commended Osuru’s criticism of popular practices that regarded dreams as evidence about the afterlife. Bewaji pointed out that many persons from so-called civilized societies still consider dreams evidence of another world. He also commended Kithanje for arguing that there could not be many gods, because such gods could not account for the uniformity of creation (106-07).

In chapter four of his book, Philosophy in an African Place, Bruce Janz reflected upon Oruka’s sage philosophy project. He noted that the approach seemed to solve the paradox of African philosophy by appealing to universal principles of reason and exploring the context of African lived experience. Yet, Oruka imported Western philosophical ideas to a large extent and left them mostly unacknowledged.  This was problematic since his project purports to be all about African philosophizing. Additionally, Janz offered critiques of the methodology.  The method at first looked promising, by focusing on conversation between sage and the interviewer (an academically trained philosopher) where the two cooperatively worked toward truth.  Yet, to Janz, it often sounded nevertheless like it was the academic philosopher who focused upon and made manifest the latent reasoning in the sage’s conversation. Janz noted that past, outmoded ethnographies turned Africans into objects of others’ studies and declared that he therefore preferred open-ended conversation. But the structure of questions that most sages were asked in interviews steered them toward certain answers that fit in the context of past Western philosophical paradigms such as asking for an essence (What is wisdom? What is virtue?). Such questions presumed that increasing levels of abstraction were abilities to be praised in a sage. Interviewers guided the sages, he argued, by eliciting the sage’s opinion on topics that the interviewer thought important.  Janz also took Oruka to task for promising to evaluate which of the sages were wise according to an objective criterion. Janz noted the complex and multiple aspects of being a wise person, and suggested that it would not be easy for anyone to sort out the wise from the not-wise. Further, Oruka did not address whether or not wisdom is a culture-bound concept. Janz suggested that wisdom was better recognized intersubjectively, identified in “a process of explicating shared meanings in a community, rather than identifying an essence” (107).

Omedi Ochieng likewise insisted that the sages be placed in a context where their speech could be understood contextually, and he found several places where Oruka failed to fill in important aspects of context. In fact he questioned the “interview” as Oruka’s chosen method, suggesting that sages might not understand an interview as a context in which to justify their philosophical beliefs when challenged by a provocateur. Adversarial debate is a particular form of philosophizing that may not be valued by the sage. But Ochieng did think that interviews with sages in some form should still be done in a “reconstructed” version of African sage philosophy (“Epistemology” 346-47, 359).

Janz similarly suggested that Oruka depended too much on the idea of philosophizing as critique and divergence from communally accepted beliefs. Why not look for other signs of wisdom, such as creative thinking? Janz found many examples of creative thinking among the sages, such as Stephen Kithanje’s “fecund metaphor of God being like heat and cold.” Likewise, Okemba Chaungo showed through his debate of the relative good of wisdom versus land that the seeming contradiction could be overcome by understanding different senses of “good” (109). In general, Janz was frustrated that sage philosophy was not more self-critical about its methods, did not come to terms with its positionality, and did not devote time to critiquing its own methods.

W. J. Ndaba critiqued Oruka’s work, arguing that the ideal of philosophy as “an individual, explicit, critical and self-critical ratiocinative consciousness” was a Western notion, since such emphasis was “counterproductive for the emergence of a genuinely rooted African philosophy” (17). He held that an African perspective would value the folk sage, that is, the person who consulted the wisdom of their community and did not try to do it alone. He referred to the Zulu proverb, Iso—elilodwa—kaliphumeleli (“An eye—when it is one—does not succeed”), to emphasize the importance of consulting other persons who could “note points of detail which elude him or unforeseen snags which turn up to mar his plan” (20-21).  He disagreed with Oruka’s claims that the philosophic sage was more valuable than the folk sage. He did, however, appreciate Oruka’s emphasis on the philosophical sage being able to warn society against holding one-sided or close-minded, ethnocentric views.

While there have been critics of sage philosophy, there have also been many scholars who have appreciated its contribution. In addition to those already mentioned above, substantive treatments of Oruka’s project can be found in the works of Lucius Outlaw (in Oruka Sage); Sophie Oluwole, Muyiwa Falaiye and Ulrich Loelke (in Graness and Kresse), and others.

7. Culture Philosophy and Its Relationship to Philosophic Sages

Oruka was convinced, both by his training in practical philosophy as well as his own sense of values and priorities, that philosophy in general, and the sage philosophy project in particular, had to address itself to the concrete problems facing Kenyans and Africans.  It should address issues in the present and suggest a course of action to make Africa’s future better.. Thus, he wanted his project to be both practical and accessible to a general audience beyond academia. He often wrote for the newspapers, such as the Daily Nation, and other popular publications. In 1986, he participated in a study sponsored by the Institute of African Studies at the University of Nairobi called “Kenya’s Socio-Political Profiles” where he was required to contribute a broad outline of the general beliefs and practices of the Luo ethnic group (Oruka Sage 1990 ed., 53, 58-61). In 1986 he became an expert witness for a now-famous trial often referred to as the S. M. Otieno burial saga. Oruka took the witness stand, and gave an account of the philosophy and practices of burial among those from the Luo ethnic group. He argued that his expertise was due to his study of so many interviews with philosophical sages from the area. He included a transcript of his evidence in court in Sage Philosophy (1990 ed., 65-80).

Note that “culture philosophy,” that is, an account of the prevailing beliefs of an ethnic community, was an offshoot of interviews aimed at discovering philosophic sagacity. In order to see how a particular sage deviated from norms in his individual, critical thinking, the sage often began by recounting reigning shared values in his community. This “offshoot” of sorts (which Oruka had before dismissed in a disparaging way as philosophy only in a broad or even “debased” sense) now became a focus. Some experts in customary law even accused Oruka of giving the court an outdated account of practices, presented as timeless truths of the Luo ethnic group (Cotran 155). When Oruka was in the witness stand, Khaminwa, Wambui Otieno’s lawyer, asked him whether in traditional society there may be people opposed to customs who want to depart from those customs and do things their own way. Oruka explained to Khaminwa that “in a traditional communal society there were very few rebels” (Sage 1990 ed., 70). He minimized the existence and role of such dissent, even though in his academic work on sage philosophy he particularly championed such dissent.

Rather than see him as taking on the role of ethnophilosopher, Ochieng’-Odhiambo suggested that, at that point, Oruka showed that he himself was a philosophic sage able to recount the traditions of his ethnic group while also resolving any inconsistencies (Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends 125). Masolo thought that Oruka’s popularity grew because of his role in the trial, due to his ability to unmask the faulty logic of the widow’s defense team that equated “modern” with “Western” in a stereotypical and unfair way ("Sage"). Be that as it may, the court case can also be seen as another missed opportunity for Oruka to champion the rights of women in a male-dominated context (Presbey, 2012, 2013).

The court case was the beginning of a new phase in Oruka’s sage research. As Oruka explained, due to his notoriety in the case, he was offered work sensitizing District Officers and Commissioners to Luo philosophy and customs. When he gave these talks, he reiterated common beliefs among the Luos and quoted individual philosophical sages (Sage 1990 ed., 58-64). He also put his sage sources to use when studying Kenyan beliefs and practices regarding family planning, for the Department of Populations. He had two control groups, non-sages and sages, and gave the views of both. His main point was that Kenyan traditions and values already had the resources for population control through natural family planning.  Further, a sensitive study of the culture of Kenyan people could reveal attitudes and practices that worked against family planning and then point the way to solutions to the problem. Here he seemed to have crossed over quite a bit into the social sciences. Dorothy Munyakho explained that his approach was still considered experimental and controversial from the perspective of people in Population Studies who were more familiar with demographics and statistics than with qualitative analysis of interview content (21).

Critic Didier Kaphagawani, in a 1987 article reprinted in Sage Philosophy, charged sage philosophy with being parasitic on ethnophilosophy, insofar as philosophic sages practiced second-order reflection and analysis of first-order ethnophilosophy (Kaphagawani in Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 181-204). But Oruka responded and clarified. He said instead that philosophic sagacity is second order to culture philosophy. Sages reflect upon the culture, though not as it is summarized in consensus form and analyzed by professional philosophers, theologians, or missionaries (as in ethnophilosophy); rather, they do so based on their first-hand observations of the culture philosophy through their personal experiences in the community (Sage 1991 ed., xxiii). This same point could serve as a fine-tuned criticism of Momoh’s terminology mentioned above, since Momoh sometimes referred to ethnophilosophy and communal philosophy without distinction. Momoh added the helpful point that all communal philosophies, not just African communal philosophies, are non-critical, and he gave some examples from Britain (The Substance 59, 63).

In an article, “Sage Philosophy Revisited,” based on a radio interview in 1993 and published posthumously, Oruka noted that some scholars considered his project “just one of the brands of ethnophilosophy,” similar to Mbiti and others, and disagreed with those critics (Practical 183). He agreed that he studied “culture philosophy” and described it as the “beliefs, practices, myths, taboos, and general values of a people” (Sage 1991 ed., xxiii). To the end, Oruka trusted his method more than that of ethnophilosophers like Tempels because he based his accounts of culture philosophy on the testimony of trusted indigenous experts (the philosophical sages), and he considered himself to be conveying only what they had told him (Sage 1990 ed., 57; 1991 ed., 43n2). Of course, there is no escaping one’s role in shaping the data insofar as the researcher, even Oruka himself, decides which parts of which interviews to highlight when presenting them to others. This methodological point was raised by Emmanuel Eze regarding Oruka’s work (Eze and Lewis 19).

It’s important to note that as time went on, ethnophilosophy’s staunchest critic, Paulin Hountondji, modified his position.  He reflected on the debate that was started by his criticism of ethnophilosophy and said in 2002 that his earlier rejection of collective thought was excessive. He explained that collective culture must be taken seriously, and that individuality is fashioned from a basic personality, which has rootedness. While he agreed that individual thought should be seen in cultural context, he noted that it should not be stuck there. Roots should not become a “prison house” (The Struggle 128, 151-52, 204-05). Also, one of Hountondji’s biggest complaints about the ethnophilosophers like Tempels was that they were foreigners, or if not foreigners, at least they were writing for a foreign audience, responding to debates and criteria created abroad. Hountondji called this “extroversion,” and wanted instead to have African philosophy being written by Africans and responding to the interests and needs of Africans (“Introduction”). Certainly, the trajectory of Oruka’s interests in the sages showed that over time, the issue of proving anything to outsiders diminished in importance, as the question of how sage wisdom and reflection could help Kenya and Africa took center stage (Ochieng’-Odhiambo "The Tripartite" 21, "The Evolution" 29, and "Philosophic" 78; Kalumba 39-40; Presbey “Sage Philosophy: Criteria").

8. Oruka’s Sage Philosophy: the Last Few Years

Oruka intended his sage philosophy project to continue to grow. He called his 1992 book, on former Vice-President of Kenya Jaramogi Oginga Odinga, a continuing study in sage philosophy (Practical 162). In many respects, Oginga Odinga was quite different than the other sages, insofar as he was literate, had formal education and extensive experience in government (being first vice president of Kenya and later a presidential candidate) and had also traveled abroad.  Nevertheless, Oruka insisted that in Oginga Odinga’s role as ker, that is, spiritual and cultural leader of the Luo people, he maintained with the other sages an important commitment to the betterment of his community. Oruka also clarified that, while he had begun his sage philosophy research interviewing illiterate elder sages, because their testimony might soon be lost, he never intended his project to be limited to the illiterate, elderly or rural persons. Thus, speculations that his project would become out of date the more that literacy spread in Africa were based on a misunderstanding of his project (Sage 1990 ed., xviii). Indeed, in Sage Philosophy, he included an interview of one young, educated sage, Chaungo Barasa (a water engineer), due to his wisdom and his commitment to his community (1990 ed., 149-57).

Oruka articulated and emphasized other reasons to continue sage philosophy as a project, including the need for a generation of Kenyans who grew up in cities to remain connected to their roots. He was also concerned with the practical challenges of poverty and corruption and curtailment of liberties in Kenya. He thought that sages, from the obscure rural ones to the more famous ones like Oginga Odinga, could offer a bold moral critique of Kenyan society that could help people improve their lives both individually and as a community and nation.

Oruka’s life was cut short in a road accident in December of 1995. As a pedestrian, he was struck down by a motorist in the streets of Nairobi (Nation Reporter 40). Further studies in sage philosophy have certainly been stymied by this loss but not wholly halted. Anke Graness and Kai Kresse quickly assembled scholars to comment on sage philosophy’s legacy in a memorial book to Oruka that came out shortly after his death, Sagacious Reasoning. A book of essays that Oruka had been working on at the time of his death, Practical Philosophy, was subsequently published. This book divided Oruka’s essays into four sections, one on African philosophy and culture and the other three covering issues of truth and faith, value and ideology, and environmental ethics. Excerpts of sage interviews can be found in some collections on African philosophy (see Oruka’s interview of Paul Mbuya Akoko in Hord and Lee 32-44).

9. Sage Philosophy Research by Other Philosophers: Students

To explore the ongoing influence of sage philosophy, it’s best to cast a wide net. While “philosophic sagacity” was a specialized part of sage philosophy, the project also included folk sages and culture philosophy. It makes sense to survey those who found Oruka’s emphasis on the interview process central to their own work in African philosophy. Some of these persons did not mind drawing upon interviews as well as proverbs. Many provided extensive historical background and filled in details of the context of those they interviewed to a far greater extent than Oruka ever did in his studies, and they did so for good methodological reasons. Some refined the interview method beyond Oruka’s own practice, going more in-depth, refraining from misleading questions, and some even preferred participant observation to interview. With all of these variations, it is best to understand these works as influenced by Oruka and perhaps even as improvements on his project, rather than as strict copies.

This survey will begin with those who had been Oruka’s own graduate students. Most published work beyond their original theses and many became scholars in their own right. During Oruka’s time at University of Nairobi, MA and PhD students such as Kenyans Ngungi Kathanga, Oriare Nyarwath, Patrick Dikirr, F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo ("The Significance"), Wairimu Gichohi, and Nigerian Anthony Oseghare  incorporated sage philosophy as a topic and/or interviews with sages into their studies while under Oruka’s supervision. Some of them published articles sharing their research with others. Oseghare’s thesis reiterated many points of Oruka’s own position—holding  a universalist definition of philosophy, limiting investigation to texts that met the philosophical standards of being critical, rigorous and of a second-order activity—and  analyzed three sages according to this criteria. Two of the sages appeared in Oruka’s book, and Oseghare’s commentary on those two sages was excerpted and included in Sage Philosophy. But the thesis included discussion of a third sage, Oigara from the Kisii community. Oseghare liked Oigara best because unlike Oruka Rang’inya (who happened to be Oruka’s father) who explained the psychology behind “explaining events through the activities of spirits as a ploy of encouraging good behavior,” Oigara instead directly appealed to individuals' abilities to make rational judgments (Oseghare xii). Oseghare concluded that the sages met his criteria for philosophical thinking.

Gichohi analyzed the interviews of sages included in Sage Philosophy (1991), finding contradictions in the concepts and positions held by some of the sages regarding their concepts of God.  For starters, she questioned why Paul Mbuya Akoko said there must be one god to account for the orderliness of the universe.  According to Gichohi, Mbuya begged the question, for who is to say that many gods must take on a mischievous character? (89). She also noted that Mbuya said that no one really knows God but later affirmed that God exists and rules nature (91). She noted that Oruka Rang'inya was involved in a contradiction between God being a concept and God's living in the wind (93). She further was concerned that M'Mukindia Kithanje's interpretation of God as present at the biological process of procreation confused the mysterious or marvelous with God (94). When it came to their ideas for the improvement of society, Gichohi found some of the sages' suggestions problematic.  Gichohi was particularly concerned with Mbuya Akoko's suggestion that a criminal should be administered a drug during which time he could be reformed.  She expressed her skepticism that such a procedure would reform the individual.  Since being subjected to such drugs involuntarily is dehumanizing, how could one be reformed while his humanity has been eroded?  In addition, Mbuya did not explain what type of offender and under what circumstance the punishment should be administered.  These are all very important objections to the procedure which were not even questioned during the interview (103-04).  Likewise, when Simiyu said that illness is due to laziness, his view, although perhaps sometimes true, could not count for all cases, such as physical destruction and disease brought on by earthquakes and other large-scale calamities not caused by humans. (131-32).

Ochieng’-Odhiambo described in his thesis and subsequent articles that his efforts were aimed at exploring “philosophic sagacity” to prove to skeptics that Africans can philosophize. For this reason, he explained, “my efforts were channeled toward presenting the thoughts of some sages in an elaborate and rarefied manner. More specifically, I concentrated on those topics that had been the focus of most ancient Greek philosophers” ("The Tripartite" 18). By proceeding in such a way, he would not only “uncoil” the philosophical ideas and logic of the sages but also “show beyond the shadow of a doubt that philosophers existed in traditional Africa” ("The Tripartite" 19). As Ochieng’-Odhiambo explained in a 1997 article that presented some of his 1994 dissertation’s findings, “The rationale of my approach was that if the thoughts of the pre-Socratics are philosophical (and this is never doubted) and if the African (Kenyan) sages think in a similar manner, then they should also be granted the prestige of being philosophical” ("Philosophic" 174). Oruka himself made references to the sages being at least as good as the pre-Socratics (Sage 1990 ed., xv-xvi, xxv, 37), so Ochieng’-Odhiambo was clearly following Oruka’s lead. The rest of the article, based on the research he did for his dissertation, involved interviewing sages and asking them, for example, questions on change and permanence. Ochieng’-Odhiambo asked Rose Ondhewe Odhiambo whether things change or are permanent (in obvious reference to the Parmenides and Heraclitus paradox). She gave a nuanced answer: some things change more than they are permanent, and some are more permanent and change little. Certainly she used reason and put forward a rational view. Ochieng’-Odhiambo went on to interview a man, Naftali Ong’alo, who when asked what the single most important element is, argued that “water is the single most important thing in the universe” (“Philosophic” 175-77).

It’s possible to raise some methodological questions regarding the approach in Ochieng’-Odhaimbo’s early works. The problem of asking “leading questions,” whether pursued intentionally or not, is a real one for any interviewer; Ochieng’-Odhaimbo himself addressed the dangers of leading questions in another work of his (Trends 132-33). While his studies with Oruka were in the 1990s, he continued to address African Philosophy in general, and sage philosophy in particular, as a key topic in his philosophical writings. He gave a thorough account of Oruka’s sage project in his 2002 and 2006 articles, and in his 2010 book (Trends 115-150).

Patrick Maison Dikirr published some findings from his 1994 master’s thesis which he wrote under Oruka’s supervision. Dikirr interviewed Maasai sages on the topic of death. As Dikirr explained, by discussing death, certain ideas, values, or lessons were reinforced about life. There were ambiguous practices among the Maasais, some of which seemed to argue for an idea of the afterlife. For example, when a Maasai person saw a snake (black python or cobra) in a hut of someone who has recently died, they fed it milk, greeted it, and told it, “We are always together!”  After all, the snake may be a deceased important person such as an oloiboni (diviner), a great chief or counselor, or a wealthy man. But Dikirr wondered further, were snakes fed just to avert their anger, so that humans could survive?  Or, were there ethical lessons contained in the treatment of snakes, such as: do not despise strangers who may show up to one’s house? He preferred that these lessons be the real reason behind the stories. Likewise, Maasais thought that waking someone suddenly from deep sleep should be discouraged, because the spirit travels while sleeping. But, Dikirr preferred to understand this practice as a focus on the ethical values of politeness and humility toward others. Dikirr thought the Maasai conception of self was closer to the Aristotelean unitary self-experience. He found evidence to show that Maasais thought there was a permanent end to life. The dead are no longer around. The only thing left after death is how one’s personality affects the children. A person who has children will not easily fade from memory like the single person who dies without children. Here, immortality is understood as a name to remember.

Ngungi Kathanga wrote a master’s thesis on philosophic sagacity at UON in 1992. Seven male (and no female) sages, all Kikuyus from Kirinyaga district, were included in Kathanga’s study. He explained that he originally interviewed fifty women and men (he does not mention how many of the fifty were women), but only the seven men included were judged by him to be sages (96). He included three sages’ responses to questions of men and women’s equality. All three said men were superior to women. All pointed out her physical weakness, and some added other weaknesses. Mwangi Wangu stated that women are unable to keep secrets.  But he said they are respected for their roles as child-bearers, because through the naming of children, the dead survive. Joel Rukenya said women cannot rise up to tough challenges in life, and therefore should not be put in positions of power (122-24). The sages are, however, quoted as supporting racial equality (128-131).

Regarding Oginga Odinga, Peter Ogola Onyango of Moi University claims that a philosophic sage must first become a folk sage before he or she can become a philosophic sage. He then argues that Oginga Odinga proves his ability to be a folk sage by the fact that he is chosen as Ker of the Luo. Ogola Onyango then shows that Oginga Odinga is a philosophic sage because he disagreed with popular opinion of many Luos during the S. M. Otieno burial trial, when he claimed that it is fine for Luos to be buried anywhere in Kenya (240-42).

Oriare Nyarwath analyzed several of Oruka’s sages on the topic of freedom (Nyarwath in Graness and Kresse 211-218). He went on to write a PhD thesis in 2009 on Oruka’s philosophical works which included his review of the sage philosophy project’s purpose and methodology, but he did not include interviews of sages or commentary upon Oruka’s sage interviews (139-161, 247-48). Instead, the thesis focused on the question of Oruka’s commitments and overarching themes throughout his published works.

Also, students at Tangaza College in Nairobi’s Maryknoll Institute of African Studies program were regularly offered a course in sage philosophy, earlier taught by Oruka himself, then by F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo, and later, by Oriare Nyarwath (Maryknoll "Sage Philosophy"). These students continued to interview sages; their reports can be found in the Tangaza College library. In the earlier years, that is, in the 1990s, reports were almost always accompanied by transcripts of the interviews. But after around 2000, the number of student papers containing the transcript of the interviews declined. Either students gave short quotes of the interviews, or they only referred to interviews without giving any direct quotes.

10. Sage Philosophy Research by Other Philosophers: Other Scholars

Kai Kresse’s book, Philosophising in Mombasa, got its inspiration from Oruka’s project. Kresse explained that he was seeking knowledge about knowledge in the context of the Muslim community living on Kenya's Swahili coast. He wanted to study the self-reflexive, critical knowledge of local thinkers there. His book contained three in-depth portraits of local elder intellectuals and several briefer portraits of younger thinkers.  Kresse explained how his methodology differed from Oruka’s.  Unlike Oruka, Kresse did not center his study on direct questions put to each thinker interviewed, but instead observed the intellectuals during their philosophical discourses with members of their community.  Kresse himself became fluent in Swahili so that he could follow such discussions directly, and read the scholars’ lectures, poetry and other writings. He lived in the Mombasa Old Town community so that he could be socially accepted and therefore placed in situations to hear and document the most interesting discussions. Kresse also helped his readers by describing the historical, religious and cultural context in which the debates occurred, as well as the personal biographies of the participants. But like Oruka and Brenner, Kresse saw a key part of his work as documenting “the utterances of the intellectuals” (31; Brenner). While Kresse added his own interpretation, he provided clear demarcation to his commentary, so that the reader could accept or reject the interpretations offered.

Kresse then followed with several chapters, each focusing on a particular thinker.  Ahmed Sheikh Nabhany had as his goal the preservation of all that was good in Swahili traditions. Through poetry he was able to use his creative skills to communicate the basics of Islamic practices as well as moral guidelines and cultural practices. Nabhany was active in his proposals for preservation of a moral code that was losing ground in contemporary society. In his next chapter Kresse explored Ahmad Nassir, who in his poem “Utenzi wa Mtu ni Utu” summed up a moral code that involved respecting all human beings, that provided guidelines for distinguishing between good and bad actions, and that offered a way to measure moral status. Kresse considered Nassir to be an innovator insofar as he constructed a theory of utu (humaneness) and formulated sub-concepts that enforce utu. The next chapter focused on Sheikh Abdilahi Nassir’s Ramadan lectures. Kresse argued that Abdilahi was a sage, referring to Oruka’s use of the term in the context of his sage philosophy project. Abdulahi’s practice of rethinking his own positions on issues of dire importance to his community, and the extent of his conscious effort to clarify his ideas, made Abdulahi’s practices a clear example of philosophizing (206-07).

Kresse followed the book with an article in 2008 that engaged in a study of the concept of wisdom, based on two Swahili sages. He argued that a person is identified as wise if they are able to make others see the world in a different light or from a new perspective. He argued that wisdom required social performance and interaction ("Can," 194, 199).

Workineh Kelbessa, a philosopher from Ethiopia who had met Oruka and was inspired by his project, used Oruka's interview method to gain knowledge about environmental values among the Oromo of Ethiopia. He wrote a book about his findings. His work drew upon culture philosophy as well as the insights of philosophic sages. He explained, “In this work, the term ‘indigenous environmental ethics’ is used sometimes to refer to the ethical views of philosophic sages who have their own independent views, and in most cases it is used as a plural (of ‘environmental ethic’) to refer to the norms and values of various Oromo groups and of other indigenous peoples” (ch. 1). His objective was to “show how indigenous knowledge systems can serve as a critical resource base for the process of development and a healthy environment.” He cautioned that he did not intend to engage in uncritical, nostalgic acceptance of Oromo indigenous knowledge.  He used various sources, but depended most upon “interviewing, focus group discussion and observation” because they “enable us to understand values and attitudes of the people towards the environment at a level inaccessible to a questionnaire.” He interviewed peasant farmers and pastoralists to learn about their concepts of time and divination, their ecotheology, and their attitudes toward wild animals, forests, and agriculture (ch. 1). His study drew upon many proverbs.

A further sage philosophy study which attempted to apply the insights gained from sage philosophy to the topic of a new national culture for Kenya was written by Chaungo Barasa, who helped Oruka conduct his sage philosophy interviews. Chaungo argued that cultural practices needed to be connected to consistent thoughts and belief systems.  He suggested Kenyans re-examine their lives and cultures in five areas:  the intersection/harmonization of tradition and modernity, death and burial ceremonies, marriage and inheritance, inter-family and clan relations, and leadership and role-modeling.  All of this could be attained with the help of sage philosophy, which encouraged people to pursue wisdom and reflect on their beliefs.  The family taught moral behavior, he noted; however, in Kenya’s modern families (making up about 35 percent of the population) there was, he argued, a lack of morality. “Modern” Kenyans, he wrote, held a flawed concept of modernity, equating it with European culture and religion, and their understanding of that culture was rudimentary and incoherent.  Chaungo maintained that the modern Kenyan also had a stunted understanding of indigenous cultures and traditions; in their place were materialism, and consumerism, and status.  They barely masked their distaste for rural folk and environment, Chaungo argued; yet, they engaged in gender oppression which contradicted modernity.  Also, modern Kenyans were easily manipulated and bought by various politicians.  Such a description showed that philosophical reflection upon tradition was mandatory in order for society to become productive and coherent.

Oral historian E. S. Atieno-Odhiambo’s article “Luo Perspectives on Knowledge and Development:  Samuel G. Ayany and Paul Mbuya” (2000) analyzed and evaluated books and pamphlets written by these two sages. Paul Mbuya Akoko, interviewed by Oruka and included in Sage Philosophy, was also a writer.  This article met the two criteria of quoting individual sages, and engaging in critical analysis. Since the sages addressed the topic of development, the thrust of the article also fit in with Oruka’s expressed goals for his sage philosophy project. Mbuya was not the only sage included in Oruka’s Sage Philosophy who had written down his own ideas, and yet Oruka did not analyze the written works of the sages he included in his study.

In his “Conversations with Luo Sages,” D. A. Masolo recorded a conversation of pressing issues of the day in which a sage takes center stage, and in which Masolo was a participant but did not direct the conversation. Masolo considered this an example of participant observation, which, according to some anthropologists, could be a more reliable source of texts for understanding African philosophy than interviews. Masolo included this conversation transcript in his book Self and Community (255-60) because it shed light on contemporary moral debate in Kenya. While not explicitly expressed, what “emerged” during the conversation was the question of whether the worth of abstract moral principles “ought to be judged independently of any real situation” (263). Masolo then further analyzed the issues raised, in the context of moral positions expressed by Kant, Hume, and Wiredu. In another part of the same work, Masolo drew upon the insights of a sage interviewed by Oruka, Paul Mbuya Akoko. He found these to express helpful ideas for grounding the ethics of communalism, described by the sage as, in Masolo’s words, “a norm arrived at for purposes of affecting order in the lives of people by reducing social differences and promoting peace” (50). Masolo could be seen as a contemporary advocate and practitioner of a variant of sage philosophy.  His methods focused not on interviews of a sage by a researcher, but rather the analysis of discourse at various public fora in which the sages gathered, such as “palavers,” public debates and negotiations. In these contexts, sages used their mental skills and were involved in sustained critical inquiry ("Sage Philosophy").

Richard Bell’s book, Understanding African Philosophy, devoted a section to Oruka’s sage philosophy. He wanted to take Oruka’s project further by exploring oral philosophy as an example of narrative and Socratic discourse found not only in the texts of sages but also in everyday discourse and village palavers (32-35, 111-12).). For Bell, philosophy in Africa had to be tied to the experience of the lived reality of Africa, which was made up of the pre-colonial traditions of Africa, and its colonial history, current harsh circumstances, and human struggles (35). Bell analogized to Plato’s dialogues, such as Euthyphro, where, in the context of everyday life, circumstances give rise to philosophical dilemmas.  Sages similarly prompted to engage in discussion as well as deep thought, and they grappled with situations which gave rise to what Bell called the “narrative ‘stuff’ of philosophy” (112).

Bekele Gutema argued that sage philosophy’s method was particularly productive in exploring topics of conflict resolution, such as crises of democracy, problems of ruling elites and corruption, and ethnic strife. Sages emphasized solutions that addressed the needs and perspectives of all parties, having as their goals the harmony between people as well as between people and nature. He added what he knew about elders being involved in reconciliation from his own experience (208-11). Presbey interviewed sages with these themes in mind. She found sages in both Kenya and Ghana who shared their insights into conflict, whether interpersonal or ethnic, and their procedures for bringing estranged parties together. She quoted from her interviews with the sages and evaluated their insights (Presbey “Contemporary African Sages"; “Philosophic Sages"; “Sage Philosophy and Critical Thinking").

Charles Verharen of Howard University engaged in a project which combined Oruka’s sage philosophy project with the methods of Claude Sumner, S.J., the scholar who studied Ethiopian philosophy while living there for 45 years. Verharen noted that Sumner, following the suggestion of Alain Locke, enlisted the aid of linguists and anthropologists to do his philosophical work, something that Oruka did not do, but that Verharen considered essential to his project. Verharen engaged in interviews both among the Oromo and, with the help of Rianna Oelofsen of University of Fort Hare, South Africa, among the Xhosa and San. Verharen explained that he was drawn to study sage philosophy out of concerns for cultural survival as well as philosophy’s survival, as he searched for “better stories to tell” in a world where human survival was jeopardized (83-88). He suggested interviewing both those known as sages and a broader group drawn from all parts of the society, questioning them in such a way as to reveal their level of critical rationality (75-76).

Kazeem likewise suggests that sage philosophy research should continue with slight modifications in order that philosophers can salvage “indigenous epistemologies threatened with extinction” and thereby contribute to a “polycentric global epistemology” (200). Kazeem names his approach “hermeneutico-reconstructionism” and asserts that it can be used to solve Africa’s current problems (200-01).

Oruka’s contribution to the field of African philosophy was substantial, and his influence is ongoing, as sage research continues.

11. References and Further Reading

  • Abraham, W. E. The Mind of Africa. Chicago: U of Chicago P, 1962.
  • Atieno-Odhiambo, E. S. “Luo Perspectives on Knowledge and Development: Samuel G. Ayany and Paul Mbuya.” African Philosophy as Cultural Inquiry. Ed Ivan Karp and D. A. Masolo. Bloomington: Indiana UP, 2000. 244–258.  African Systems of Thought.
  • Azenabor, Godwin. "Odera Oruka’s Philosophic Sagacity: Problems and Challenges of Conversation Method in African Philosophy.” Premier Issue. Spec. issue of Thought and Practice: A Journal of the Philosophical Association of Kenya ns 1.1 (June 2009): 69-86.
  • Azenabor, Godwin. Understanding the Problems in African Philosophy. Second Edition. Lagos, Nigeria: First Academic Publishers, 2002.
  • Bell, Richard H. Understanding African Philosophy: A Cross-Cultural Approach to Classical and Contemporary Issues. New York: Routledge, 2002.
  • Bewaji, Tunde. Rev. of Sage Philosophy, ed. H. Odera Oruka. Quest: Philosophical Discussions 7.1 (June 1994): 104-111.
  • Brenner, Louis. West African Sufi: The Religious Heritage and Spiritual Search of Cerno Bokar Saalif Taal. London: C. Hurst, 1984.
  • Chaungo, Barasa. “Narrowing the Gap between Past Practices and Future Thoughts in a Transitional Kenyan Cultural Model, for Sustainable Family Livelihood Security (FLS).” Presbey, et al. Thought and Practice 217–222.
  • Cotran, E. “The Future of Customary Law in Kenya.” The S. M. Otieno Case: Death and Burial in Modern Kenya. Ed. J. B. Ojwang and J. N. K. Mugambi. Kenya: Nairobi UP, 1989. 149-165.
  • Dikirr, Patrick Maison. "The Philosophy and Ethics Concerning Death and Disposal of the Dead Among the Maasai." MA Thesis U of Nairobi, 1994.
  • Donders, J. G. “Don’t Fence Us In: The Liberating Role of Philosophy." 11th Inaugural Lecture. University of Nairobi. 10 March 1977. Nairobi: Joseph Gerard Publication, U of Nairobi, 1977.
  • Eze, Emmanuel, and Rick Lewis. “African Philosophy at the Turn of the Millennium: Rick Lewis in Dialogue with Emmanuel Chukwudi Eze.” Polylog: Forum for Intercultural Philosophizing 1.1 (2000): 1-28.
  • Gichohi, Wairimu. “Indigenous African Philosophical Knowledge: A Critique.” MA Thesis U of Nairobi, 1996.
  • Goody, Jack. Rev. of Conversations with Ogotemmeli: An Introduction to Dogon Religious Ideas, by Marcel Griaule. American Anthropologist n.s. 69.2 (April 1967): 239-41.
  • Graness, Anke, and Kai Kresse, eds. Sagacious Reasoning: Henry Odera Oruka in Memoriam. Frankfurt am Main: Lang, 1997.  Nairobi: East African Educational, 1999.  (Page numbers are the same).
  • Gutema, Bekele. “The Role of Sagacity in Resolving Conflicts Peacefully.” Presbey, Thought and Practice 207-216.
  • Gyekye, Kwame. An Essay on African Philosophical Thought: The Akan Conceptual Scheme. Rev. ed. Philadelphia: Temple UP, 1995.
  • Hallen, Barry. African Philosophy: The Analytic Approach. Trenton, NJ: Africa World P, 2006.
  • Hallen, Barry. A Short History of African Philosophy. 2nd ed. Bloomington: Indiana UP, 2009.
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Author Information

Gail M. Presbey
University of Detroit Mercy
U. S. A.

Kwasi Wiredu (1931— )

Kwasi Wiredu is a philosopher from Ghana, who has for decades been involved with a project he terms “conceptual decolonization” in contemporary African systems of thought.  By conceptual decolonization, Wiredu advocates a re-examination of current African epistemic formations in order to accomplish two aims.  First, he wishes to subvert unsavory aspects of tribal culture embedded in modern African thought so as to make that thought more viable.  Second, he intends to dislodge unnecessary Western epistemologies that are to be found in African philosophical practices.

In previously colonized regions of the world, decolonization remains a topical issue both at the highest theoretical levels and also at the basic level of everyday existence. After African countries attained political liberation, decolonization became an immediate and overwhelming preoccupation.  A broad spectrum of academic disciplines took up the conceptual challenges of decolonization in a variety of ways.  The disciplines of anthropology, history, political science, literature, and philosophy all grappled with the practical and academic conundrums of decolonization.

A central purpose in this article is to examine the contributions and limitations of African philosophy in relation to the history of the debate on decolonization.  In this light, it sometimes appears that African philosophy has been quite limited in defining the horizons of the debate when compared with the achievements of academic specialties such as literature and cultural studies. Thus, decolonization has been rightly conceived as a vast, global, and trans-disciplinary enterprise.

This analysis involves an examination of both the limitations and immense possibilities of Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization.  First, the article offers a close reading of the theory itself and then locates it within the broader movement of modern African thought.  In several instances, Wiredu’s theory has proved seminal to the advancement of contemporary African philosophical practices.  It is also necessary to be aware of current imperatives of globalization, nationality, and territoriality and how they affect the agency of a theory such as ideological/conceptual decolonization.  Indeed, the notion of decolonization is far more complex than is often assumed.  Consequently, the epistemological resources by which it can be apprehended as a concept, ideology, or process are multiple and diverse.  Lastly, this article, as a whole, represents a reflection on the diversity of the dimensions of decolonization.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Early Beginnings
  3. Decolonization as Epistemological Practice
  4. Tradition, Modernity and the Challenges of Development
  5. An African Reading of Karl Marx
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Kwasi Wiredu is one of Africa’s foremost philosophers, and he has done a great deal to establish the discipline of philosophy, in its contemporary shape, as a credible area of intellection in most parts of the African continent and beyond.  In order to appreciate the conceptual and historical contexts of his work, it is necessary to possess some familiarity with relevant discourses in African studies and history, anthropology, literature and postcolonial theory, particularly those advanced by Edward W. Said, Gayatri Spivak, Homi Bhabha, Abiola Irele and Biodun Jeyifo.  Wiredu’s contribution to the making of modern African thought provides an interesting insight into the processes involved in the formation of postcolonial disciplines and discourses, and it can also be conceived as a counter-articulation to the hegemonic discourses of imperial domination.

 Wiredu, for many decades, was involved with a project he termed conceptual decolonization in contemporary African systems of thought. This term entailed, for Wiredu, a re-examination of current African epistemic foundations in order to accomplish two main objectives.  First, he intended to undermine counter-productive facets of tribal cultures embedded in modern African, thought so as to make this body of thought both more sustainable and more rational.  Second, he intended to deconstruct the unnecessary Western epistemologies which may be found in African philosophical practices.

A broad spectrum of academic disciplines took up the conceptual challenges of decolonization in a variety of ways. In particular, the disciplines of anthropology, history, political science, literature and philosophy all grappled with the practical and academic challenges inherent to decolonization.

It is usually profitable to examine the contributions and limitations of African philosophers comparatively (along with other African thinkers who are not professional philosophers) in relation to the history of the debate on decolonization.  In addition to the scholars noted above, the discourse of decolonialization has benefitted from many valuable contributions made by intellectuals such as Frantz Fanon, Leopold Sedar Senghor, Cheikh Anta Diop, and Ngugi wa Thiongo.  In this light, it would appear that African philosophy has been, at certain moments, limited in defining the horizons of the debate when compared with the achievements of academic specialties such as literature, postcolonial theory and cultural studies. Thus, decolonization, as Ngugi wa Thiongo, the Kenyan cultural theorist and novelist, notes, must be conceived as a broad, transcontinental, and multidisciplinary venture.

Within the Anglophone contingent of African philosophy, the analytic tradition of British philosophy continues to be dominant.  This discursive hegemony had led an evident degree of parochialism.  This in turn has led to the neglect of many other important intellectual traditions.  For instance, within this Anglophonic sphere, there is not always a systematic interrogation of the limits, excesses and uses of colonialist anthropology in formulating the problematic of identity.  In this regard, the problematic of identity does not only refer to the question of personal agency but more broadly, the challenges of discursive identity.  This shortcoming is not as evident in Francophone traditions of African philosophy, which usually highlight the foundational discursive interactions between anthropology and modern African thought.  Thus, in this instance, there is an opening to other discursive formations necessary for the nurturing a vibrant philosophical practice.  Also, within Anglophone African philosophy, a stringent critique of imperialism and contemporary globalization does not always figure is not always significantly in the substance of the discourse, thereby further underlining the drawbacks of parochialism.  As such, it is necessary for critiques of Wiredu’s corpus to move beyond its ostensible frame to include critiques and discussions of traditions of philosophical practice outside the Anglophone divide of modern African thought (Osha, 2005).  Accordingly, such critiques ought not merely be a celebration of post-structuralist discourses to the detriment of African intellectual traditions.  Instead, they should be, among other things, an exploration of the discursive intimacies between the Anglophone and Francophone traditions of African philosophy.  In addition, an interrogation of other borders of philosophy is required to observe the gains that might accrue to the Anglophone movement of contemporary African philosophy, which, in many ways, has reached a discursive dead-end due to its inability to surmount the intractable problematic of identity, and its endless preoccupation with the question of its origins. These are the sort of interrogations that readings of Wiredu’s work necessitate. Furthermore, a study of Wiredu’s corpus (Osha, 2005) identifies—if only obliquely—the necessity to re-assess the importance of other discourses such as colonialist anthropology and various philosophies of black subjectivity in the formation of the modern African subject.  These are some of the central concerns which appear in Kwasi Wiredu and Beyond: The Text, Writing and Thought in Africa (2005).

2. Early Beginnings

Kwasi Wiredu was born in 1931 in Ghana and had his first exposure to philosophy quite early in life.  He read his first couple of books of philosophy in school around 1947 in Kumasi, the capital of Ashanti.  These books were Bernard Bosanquet’s The Essentials of Logic and C.E.M. Joad’s Teach Yourself Philosophy.  Logic, as a branch of philosophy attracted Wiredu because of its affinities to grammar, which he enjoyed.  He was also fond of practical psychology during the formative years of his life.  In 1950, whilst vacationing with his aunt in Accra, the capital of Ghana, he came across another philosophical text which influenced him tremendously.  The text was The Last Days of Socrates which had the following four dialogues by Plato: The Apology, Euthyphro, Meno and Crito. These dialogues were to influence, in a significant way, the final chapter of his first groundbreaking philosophical text, Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) which is also dialogic in structure.

He was admitted into the University of Ghana, Legon in 1952, to read philosophy, but before attending he started to study the thought of John Dewey on his own. However, mention must be made of the fact that C. E. M. Joad’s philosophy had a particularly powerful effect on him. Indeed, he employed the name J. E. Joad as his pen-name for a series of political articles he wrote for a national newspaper, The Ashanti Sentinel between 1950 and1951.  At the University of Ghana, he was instructed mainly in Western philosophy and he came to find out about African traditions of thought more or less through his own individual efforts.  He was later to admit that the character of his undergraduate education was to leave his mind a virtual tabula rasa, as far as African philosophy was concerned.  In other words, he had to develop and maintain his interests in African philosophy on his own. One of the first texts of African philosophy that he read was J. B. Danquah’s Akan Doctrine of God: A Fragment of Gold Coast Ethics and Religion.  Undoubtedly, his best friend William Abraham, who went a year before him to Oxford University, must have also influenced the direction of his philosophical research towards African thought.  A passage from an interview explains the issue of his institutional relation to African philosophy:

Prior to 1985, when I was in Africa, I devoted most of my time in almost equal proportions to research in African philosophy and in other areas of philosophy, such as the philosophy of logic, in which not much has, or is generally known to have, been done in African philosophy.  I did not have always to be teaching African philosophy or giving public lectures in African philosophy. There were others who were also competent to teach the subject and give talks in our Department of Philosophy.  But since I came to the United States, I have often been called upon to teach or talk about African philosophy.  I have therefore spent much more time than before researching in that area. This does not mean that I have altogether ignored my earlier interests, for indeed, I continue to teach subjects like (Western) logic and epistemology (Wiredu in Oladiop 2002: 332).

Wiredu began publishing relatively late, but has been exceedingly prolific ever since he started. During the early to mid 1970s, he often published as many as six major papers per year on topics ranging from logic, to epistemology, to African systems of thought, in reputable international journals.  His first major book, Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) is truly remarkable for its eclectic range of interests.  Paulin Hountondji, Wiredu’s great contemporary from the Republic of Benin, for many years had to deal with charges that his philosophically impressive corpus lacked ideological content and therefore merit from critics such as Olabiyi Yai (1977).  Hountondji (1983; 2002) in those times of extreme ideologizing, never avoided the required measure of socialist posturing.  Wiredu, on the other hand, not only avoided the lure of socialism but went on to denounce it as an unfit ideology.  Within the context of the socio-political moment of that era, it seemed a reactionary—even injurious—posture to adopt.  Nonetheless, he had not only laid the foundations of his project of conceptual decolonization at the theoretical level but had also begun to explore its various practical implications by his analyses of concepts such as “truth,” and also by his focused critique of some of the more counter-productive impacts of both colonialism and traditional culture.

By conceptual decolonization, Wiredu advocates a re-examination of current African epistemic formations in order to accomplish two objectives.  First, he wishes to subvert unsavoury aspects of indigenous traditions embedded in modern African thought so as to make it more viable.  Second, he intends to undermine the unhelpful Western epistemologies to be found in African philosophical traditions. On this important formulation of his he states:

By this I mean the purging of African philosophical thinking of all uncritical assimilation of Western ways of thinking. That, of course, would be only part of the battle won. The other desiderata are the careful study of our own traditional philosophies and the synthesising of any insights obtained from that source with any other insights that might be gained from the intellectual resources of the modern world.  In my opinion, it is only by such a reflective integration of the traditional and the modern that contemporary African philosophers can contribute to the flourishing of our peoples and, ultimately, all other peoples. (Oladipo, 2002: 328)

In spite of his invaluable contributions to modern African thought, it can be argued that Wiredu’s schema falls short as a feasible long term epistemic project.  Due to the hybridity of the postcolonial condition, projects seeking to retrieve the precolonial heritage are bound to be marred at several levels.  It would be an error for Wiredu or advocates of his project of conceptual decolonization to attempt to universalize his theory since, as Ngugi wa Thiongo argues, decolonization is a vast, global enterprise.  Rather, it is safer to read Wiredu’s project as a way of articulating theoretical presence for the de-agentialized and deterritorialized contemporary African subject.  In many ways, his project resembles those of Ngugi wa Thiongo and Cheikh Anta Diop.  Ngugi wa Thiongo advocates cultural and linguistic decolonization on a global scale and his theory has undergone very little transformation since its formulation in the 1960s.  Diop advances a similar set of ideas to Wiredu on the subject of vibrant modern African identities. Wiredu’s project is linked in conceptual terms to the broader project of political decolonization as advanced by liberationist African leaders such as Julius Nyerere, Jomo Kenyatta, Kwame Nkrumah, and Nnamdi Azikiwe.  But what distinguishes the particular complexion of his theory is its links with the Anglo-Saxon analytic tradition. This dimension is important in differentiating his project from those of his equally illustrious contemporaries such as V. Y. Mudimbe and Paulin Hountondji.  In fact, it can be argued that Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization has more similarities with Ngugi wa Thiongo’s ideas regarding African cultural and linguistic agency than Mudimbe’s archeological excavations of African traces in Western historical and anthropological texts.

3. Decolonization as Epistemological Practice

In all previously colonized regions of the world, decolonization remains a topic of considerable academic interest.  Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization is essentially what defines his attitudes and gestures towards the content of contemporary African thought.  Also it is an insight that is inflected by years of immersion into British analytic philosophy.  Wiredu began his reflections of the nature, legitimate aims, and possible orientations in contemporary African thought not as a result of any particular awareness of the trauma or violence of colonialism or imperialism but by a confrontation with the dilemma of modernity by the reflective (post)colonial African consciousness.  This dialectic origin can be contrasted with those of his contemporaries such as Paulin Hountondji and V. Y. Mudimbe.

Despite criticisms regarding some aspects of his work, in terms of founding a tradition for the practice of modern African philosophy, Wiredu’s contributions have been pivotal. He has also been very consistent in his output and the quality of his reflections regardless of some of their more obvious limitations.

As noted earlier, Wiredu was trained in a particular tradition of Western philosophy: the analytic tradition.  This fact is reflected in his corpus.  A major charge held against him is that his contributions could be made even richer if he had grappled with other relevant discourses: postcolonial theory, African feminisms, contemporary Afrocentric discourses and the global dimensions of projects and discourses of decolonization.

Kwasi Wiredu’s interests and philosophical importance are certainly not limited to conceptual decolonization alone.  He has offered some useful insights on Marxism, mysticism, metaphysics, and the general nature of the philosophical enterprise itself. Although his latter text, Cultural Universals and Particulars has a more Africa-centred orientation, his first book, Philosophy and an African Culture presents a wider range of discursive interests: a vigorous critique of Marxism, reflections on the phenomenon of ideology, analyses of truth and the philosophy of language, among other preoccupations. It is interesting to see how Wiredu weaves together these different preoccupations and also to observe how some of them have endured while others have not.

The volume Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy is an apt summation of Wiredu’s philosophical interests with a decidedly African problematic while his landmark philosophical work, Philosophy and an African Culture, published first in 1980, should serve as a fertile source for more detailed elucidation.

In the second essay of Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy entitled “The Need for Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy”, Wiredu writes that “with an even greater sense of urgency the intervening decade does not seem to have brought any indications of a widespread realization of the need for conceptual decolonisation in African philosophy” (Wiredu, 1995: 23).  The intention at this juncture is to examine some of the ways in which Wiredu has been involved in the daunting task of conceptual decolonization.  Decolonization itself is a problematic exercise because it necessitates the jettisoning of certain conceptual attitudes that inform one’s worldviews.  Secondly, it usually entails an attempt at the retrieval of a more or less fragmented historical heritage.  Decolonization in Fanon’s conception entails this necessity for all colonized peoples and, in addition, it is “a programme of complete disorder” (Fanon, 1963:20).  This understanding is purely political and has therefore, a practical import.  This is not to say that Fanon had no plan for the project of decolonization in the intellectual sphere.  Also associated with this project as it was then conceived was a struggle for the mental liberation of the colonized African peoples.  It was indeed a program of violence in more senses than one.

However, with Wiredu, there isn’t an outright endorsement of violence, as decolonization in this instance amounts to conceptual subversion.  As a logical consequence, it is necessary to stress the difference between Fanon’s conception of decolonization and Wiredu’s.  Fanon is sometimes regarded as belonging to the same philosophical persuasion that harbours figures like Nkrumah, Senghor, Nyerere and Sekou Toure, “the philosopher-kings of early post-independence Africa” (Wiredu,1995:14), as Wiredu calls them.  This is so because they had to live out the various dramas of existence and the struggles for self and collective identity at more or less the same colonial/postcolonial moment.  Those “spiritual uncles” of professional African philosophers were engaged, as Wiredu states, in a strictly political struggle, and whatever philosophical insight they possessed was put at the disposal of this struggle, instead of a merely theoretical endeavour.  Obviously, Fanon was the most astute theoretician of decolonization of the lot.  In addition, for Fanon and the so-called philosopher-kings, decolonization was invested with a pan-African mandate and political appeal.  This crucial difference should be noted alongside what shall soon be demonstrated to be the Wiredu conception of decolonization.  Africans, generally, will have to continue to ponder the entire issue of decolonization as long as unsolved questions of identity remain and the challenges of collective development linger.  This type of challenge was foreseen by Fanon.

The end of colonialism in Africa and other Third World countries did not entail the end of imperialism and the dominance of the metropolitan countries.  Instead, the dynamics of dominance assumed a more complex, if subtle, form.  African economic systems floundered alongside African political institutions, and, as a result, various crises have compounded the seemingly perennial issue of underdevelopment.

A significant portion of post-colonial theory involves the entry of Third World scholars into the Western archive, as it were, with the intention of dislodging the erroneous epistemological assumptions and structures regarding their peoples.  This, arguably, is another variant of decolonization.  Wiredu partakes of this type of activity, but sometimes he carries the program even further.  Accordingly, he affirms:

Until Africa can have a lingua franca, we will have to communicate suitable parts of our work in our multifarious vernaculars, and in other forms of popular discourse, while using the metropolitan languages for international communication. (Wiredu, 1995:20)

This conviction has been a guiding principle with Wiredu for several years.  In fact, it is not merely a conviction; there are several instances within the broad spectrum of his philosophical corpus where he tries to put it into practice.  Two of such attempts are his essays “The Concept of Truth in the Akan Language” and “The Akan Concept of Mind.”  In the first of these articles, Wiredu states “there is no one word in Akan for truth” (Wiredu, 1985:46).  Similarly, he writes, “another linguistic contrast between Akan and English is that there is no word “fact” (Ibid.).  It is necessary to cite the central thesis of the essay; Wiredu writes that he wants “to make a metadoctrinal point which reflection on the African language enables us to see, which is that a theory of truth is not of any real universal significance unless it offers some account of the notion of being so” (Ibid.).

Wiredu’s argument here, needs to be firmer.  In many respects, he is only comparing component parts of the English language with the Akan language and not always with a view to drawing out “any real universal significance” as he says.  The entire approach seems to be irrevocably restrictive.  This is the distinction that lies between an oral culture and a textual one.  Most African intellectuals usually gloss over this difference, even though they may acknowledge it.  The difference is indeed very significant, because of the numerous imponderables that come into play.  Abiola Irele has been able to demonstrate the tremendous significance of orality in the constitution of modern African forms of literary expression.

However, Wiredu is more convincing in his essay “Democracy and Consensus in African Traditional Politics: A Plea for a Non-Party Polity”.  In this essay, Wiredu argues that the:

Ashanti system was a consensual democracy. It was a democracy because government was by the consent, and subject to the control, of the people as expressed through the representatives. It was consensual because, at least, as a rule, that consent was negotiated on the principle of consensus. (By contrast, the majoritarian system might be said to be, in principle, based on consent without consensus.) (Ibid. pp58-59)

When Wiredu broaches the issue of politics and its present and future contexts in postcolonial Africa, then we are compelled to visit a whole range of debates and discourses especially in the social sciences in Africa.  These arearguably more directly concerned with questions pertaining to governance, democracy, and the challenges of contemporary globalization.

Another essay by Wiredu, entitled “The Akan Concept of Mind” is also an attempt of conceptual recontextualization.  Wiredu begins by stating that he is restricting himself to a study of the Akans of Ghana in order “to keep the discussion within reasonable anthropological bounds” (Wiredu, 1983:113).  His objective is a modest but nevertheless important one, since it fits quite well with his entire philosophical project which, as noted, is concerned with ironing out philosophical issues “on independent grounds” and possibly in one’s own language and the metropolitan language bequeathed by the colonial heritage.

It is therefore appropriate to proceed gradually, traversing the problematic interfaces between various languages in search of satisfactory structures of meaning.  The immediate effect is a radical diminishing of the entire concept of African philosophy, a term which under these circumstances would become even more problematic.  The consequence of Wiredu’s position is that to arrive at the essence of African philosophy, it would be necessary to dismantle its monolithic structure to make it more context-bound.  First, Africa as a spatial entity would require further re-drawing of its often problematic geography.  Second, a new thematics to mediate between the general and the particular would have to be found.  Third, the critique of unanimism and ethnophilosophy would be driven into more contested terrains.  These are some of the likely challenges posed by Wiredu’s approach.

Furthermore, in dealing with the traditional Akan conceptual system, or any other, for that matter, it should be borne in mind that what is in contention is “a folk philosophy, a body of originally unwritten ideas preserved in the oral traditions, customs and usages of a people” (Ibid.).

It would be appropriate to examine more closely his article “The Akan Concept of Mind”.  Here, Wiredu enumerates the ways in which the English conception of mind differs markedly from that of the Akan, due in a large part to certain fundamental linguistic dissimilarities.  He also makes the point that “the Akans most certainly do not regard mind as one of the entities that go to constitute a person” (Ibid. 121).  It is significant to note this, but at the same time, it is difficult to imagine the ultimate viability of this approach.  Indeed after reformulating traditional Western philosophical problems to suit African conditions, it remains to be seen how African epistemological claims can be substantiated using the natural and logical procedures available to African systems of thought.  As such, it is possible to argue that this conceptual manoeuvre would eventually degenerate into a dead-end of epistemic nativism.  These are the kinds of issues raised by Wiredu’s project.

As such, inherent in the thrust for complete decolonization is the presence of colonial violence itself.  In addition, there is essentially a latent desire for epistemic violence, as well as difficulties concerning the negotiation of linguistic divides. In the following quotation, for example, Wiredu attempts to demonstrate the significance of some of those differences:

By comparison with the conflation of concepts of mind and soul prevalent in Western philosophy, the Akan separation of the “Okra” from “adwene” suggests a more analytical awareness of the sanctification of human personality. (Ibid.128)

It is necessary to substantiate more rigorously claims such as this because we may also be committing an error in establishing certain troublesome linguistic or philosophical correspondences between two disparate cultures and traditions.

Another crucial, if distressing, feature of decolonization as advanced by Wiredu is that it always has to measure itself up with the colonizing Other, that is, it finds it almost impossible to create its own image so to speak by the employment of autochthonous strategies.  This is not to assert that decolonization always has to avail itself of indigenous procedures, but the very concept of decolonization is in fact concerned with breaking away from imperial structures of dominance in order to express a will to self-identity or presence.  To be sure, the Other is always present, defacing all claims to full presence of the decolonizing subject.  This is a contradictory but inevitable trope within the postcolonial condition.  The Other is always there to present the criteria by which self-identity is adjudged either favourably or unfavourably. There is no getting around the Other as it is introduced in its own latent and covert violence, in the hesitant counter-violence of the decolonizing subject and invariably in the counter-articulations of all projects of decolonization.

4. Tradition, Modernity and the Challenges of Development

Wiredu’s later attempts at conceptual decolonization have been quite interesting.  An example of such an attempt is the essay “Custom and Morality: A Comparative Analysis of some African and Western Conceptions of Morals.”  He is able to explore at greater length some of the conceptual confusions that arise as a result of the transplantation of Western ideas within an African frame of reference.  This wholesale transference of foreign ideas and conceptual models has caused the occurrence of severe cases of identity crises and, to borrow a more apposite term, colonial mentality.  Indeed, one of the aims of Wiredu’s efforts at conceptual decolonization is to indicate instances of colonial mentality and determine strategies by which they can be minimized.  Accordingly he is quite convincing when he argues that polygamy in a traditional setting amounts to efficient social thinking but is most inappropriate within a modern framework.  In this way, Wiredu is offering a critique of a certain traditional practice that ought to be discarded on account of the demands and realities of a modern economy.

On another level, it appears that Wiredu has not sufficiently interrogated the distance between orality and textuality.  If indeed he has done so, he would be rather more skeptical about the manner in which he thinks he can dislodge certain Western philosophical structures embedded in the African consciousness.

Wiredu has always believed that traditional modes of thought and folk philosophies should be interpreted, clarified, analyzed and subjected to critical evaluation and assimilation (Wiredu, 1980: x).  Also, at the beginning of his philosophical reflections, he puts forth the crucial formulation that there is no reason why the African philosopher “in his philosophical meditations […] should not test formulations in those against intuitions in his own language” (Wiredu, 1980: xi).  And, rather than merely discussing the possibilities for evolving modern traditions in African philosophy, African philosophers should actually begin to do so (Hountondji, 1983).  In carrying out this task, the African philosopher has a few available methodological approaches.  First, he is urged to “acquaint himself with the different philosophies of the different cultures of the world, not to be encylopaedic or eclectic, but with the aim of trying to see how far issues and concepts of universal relevance can be disentangled from the contingencies of culture” (Wiredu, 1980: 31).  He also adds that “the African philosopher has no choice but to conduct his philosophical inquiries in relation to the philosophical writings of other peoples, for his ancestors left him no heritage of philosophical writings” (Wiredu, 1980: 48).  For Wiredu, the use of translations is a fundamental aspect of contemporary African philosophical practices.  However, on the dilemmas of translation in the current age of neoliberalism, it has been noted: “translations are [..] put ‘out of joint.’  However correct or legitimate they may be, and whatever right one may acknowledge them to have, they are all disadjusted, as it were unjust in the gap that affects them.  This gap is within them, to be sure, because their meanings remain necessarily equivocal; next it is in the relation among them and thus their multiplicity, and finally or first of all in the irreducible inadequation to the other language and to the stroke of genius of the event that makes the law, to all the virtualities of the original” (Derrida, 1994:19).  Wiredu does not contemplate the implications of this kind of indictment in his formulations of an approach to African philosophy.  Perhaps the task at hand is simply too important and demanding to cater to such philosophical niceties.  In relation to the kind of philosophical heritage at the disposal of the African philosopher, Wiredu identifies three main strands; “a folk philosophy, a written traditional philosophy and a modern philosophy” (Wiredu, 1980:46).  Wiredu’s approach to questions of this sort is embedded in his general theoretical stance: “It is a function, indeed a duty, of philosophy in any society to examine the intellectual foundations of its culture.  For any such examination to be of any real use, it should take the form of reasoned criticism and, where possible, reconstruction. No other way to philosophical progress is known than through criticism and adaptation” (Wiredu, 1980: 20).

The drive to attain progress is not limited to philosophical discourse alone.  Entire communities and cultures usually aim to improve upon their institutions and practices in order to remain relevant.  Societies can lose the momentum of growth and “various habits of thought and practice can become anachronistic within the context of the development of a given society; but an entire society too can become anachronistic within the context of the whole world if the ways of life within it are predominantly anachronistic.  In the latter case, of course, there is no discarding society; what you do is to modernize it” (Wiredu, 1980:1).  The theme of modernization occurs frequently in Wiredu’s corpus.  He does not fully conceptualize it nor relate it to the various ideological histories it has encountered in the domains of social science, where it became a fully fledged discipline. Modernization, for him, is based on an uncomplicated pragmatism that owes much to Deweyan thought.

This kind of posture, that is, the consistent critique of the retrogression inherent in tradition and its proclivity for the fossilization of culture, is directed at Leopold Sedar Senghor.  On Senghor, he writes, “it is almost as if he has been trying to exemplify in his own thought and discourse the lack of the analytical habit which he has attributed to the biology of the African.  Most seriously of all, Senghor has celebrated the fact our (traditional) mind is of a non-analytical bent; which is very unfortunate, seeing that this mental attribute is more of a limitation than anything else” (Wiredu, 1980:12).  Wiredu’s main criticism of Senghor is one that is always leveled against the latter.  Apart from that charge that Senghor essentializes the concept and ideologies of blackness, he is also charged with defeatism that undermines struggles for liberation and decolonization.  However, Paul Gilroy has unearthed a more sympathetic context in which to read and situate Senghorian thought.  In Gilroy’s reading, an acceptable ideology of blackness emerges from Senghor’s work. And in this way, Wiredu’s critique loses some of its originality.

Senghor is cast as a traditionalist and tradition itself is the subject of a much broader critique.  On some of the drawbacks of tradition Wiredu writes,

it is as true in Africa as anywhere else that logical, mathematical, analytical, experimental procedures are essential in the quest for the knowledge of, and control over, nature and therefore, in any endeavour to improve the condition of man. Our traditional culture was somewhat wanting in this respect and this is largely responsible for the weaknesses of traditional technology, warfare, architecture, medicine….” (Wiredu, 1980: 12) (italics mine)

Sometimes, Wiredu carries his critique of tradition too far as when he advances the view that “traditional medicine is terribly weak in diagnosis and weaker still in pharmacology” (Wiredu, 1980: 12).  In recent times, a major part of Hountondji’s project is to demonstrate that traditional knowledges are not only useful and viable but also the necessity to situate them in appropriate modern contexts.  Hountondji’s latest gesture is curious since both he and Wiredu are supposed to belong to the same philosophic tendency as described by Bodunrin under the rubric of West-led universalism.  However, Wiredu’s attack on tradition is vitiated by his project of conceptual decolonization which, in order to work, requires the recuperation of vital elements in traditional culture.

Wiredu’s stance in relation to modernization and tradition gets refined by his condemnation of some aspects of urban existence which exhibit a manifestation of postmodern environmentalism. First, he writes, “it is quite clear to me that unrestricted industrial urbanization is contrary to any humane culture; it is certainly contrary to our own” (Wiredu, 1980:22). Also, “one of the powerful strains on our extended family system is the very extensive poverty which oppresses out rural populations. Owing to this, people working in the towns and cities are constantly burdened with the financial needs of rural relatives which they usually cannot entirely satisfy”(Wiredu, 1980:22). Contemporary anthropological studies dealing with Africa have dwelt extensively on this phenomenon. The point is, in Africa, forms of sociality exists that can no longer be found in the North Atlantic civilization. If this civilization (the North Atlantic) is characterized by extreme individualism, African forms of social existence on the other hand tend towards the gregarious in which conceptions of generosity, corruption, gratitude, philanthropy, ethnicity  and even justice take on different slightly forms from what obtains within the vastly different North Atlantic context.

Also problematic is Wiredu’s reading of colonialism which is very similar to those of authors such as Ngugi wa Thiongo, Walter Rodney or even Chinua Achebe. In this reading, the colonized is abused, brutalized, silenced and reconstructed against her/his own will.  Colonialism causes the destruction of agency. On de-agentialization, Wiredu states, “any human arrangement is authoritarian if it entails any person being made to do or suffer something against his will, or if it leads to any person being hindered in the development of his own will” (Wiredu, 1980:2).  Homi Bhabha advances the notion of ambivalence to highlight the cultural reciprocities inherent in the entire colonial encounter and structure. This kind of reading of the colonial event has led to a rethinking of colonial theory. But Wiredu’s reading of the colonial encounter is infected by the radical persuasion of early African theorists of decolonization: “The period of colonial struggle was […] a period of cultural affirmation. It was necessary to restore in ourselves our previous confidence which had been so seriously eroded by colonialism. We are still, admittedly, even in post-colonial times, in an era of cultural self-affirmation” (Ibid.59).

5. An African Reading of Karl Marx

Marxist theory and discourse generally provided many African intellectuals with a platform on which to conduct many sociopolitical struggles. In fact, for many African scholars, it served as the only ideological tool. But not all scholars found Marxism acceptable. Wiredu was one of the scholars who has deep reservations about it. But he is not in doubt about the philosophical significance of Marx: “I regard Karl Marx as one of the great philosophers” (Wiredu, 1980:63). Derrida is even more forthcoming on the depth of this significance: “It will always be a fault not to read and reread and discuss Marx- which is to say also a few others- and to go beyond scholarly “reading” or “discussion.” It will be more and more a fault, a failing of theoretical, philosophical, political responsibility” (Derrida, 1994:13). Again, he writes, “the Marxist inheritance was- and still remains, and so it will remain- absolutely and thoroughly determinate. One need not be a Marxist or a communist in order to accept this obvious fact. We all live in a world, some would say a culture, that bears, at an incalculable depth, the mark of this inheritance, whether in a directly visible fashion or not”(Ibid.).

Marxism during era of the Cold War was the major ideological issue and in the present age of neoliberalism it continues to haunt (Derrida’s precise phrase is hauntology) us with its multiple legacies. Wiredu’s critique of Marx and Engels is located within the epoch of the Cold War. But from it, we get a glimpse of not only his political orientation but also his philosophical predilections. For instance, at a point, he claims “the food one eats, the hairstyle one adopts, the amount of money one has, the power one wields- all these and such circumstances are irrelevant from an epistemological point of view” (Wiredu, 1980:66). But Foucault-style analyses have demonstrated that these seemingly marginal activities have a tremendous impact on knowledge/power configurations that are often difficult to ignore. Michel de Certeau has demonstrated these so-called inconsequential acts become significant as gestures of resistance for the benefit of the weak and politically powerless. In his words, “the weak must continually turn to their own ends forces alien to them” (de Certeau 1984: xix). On those specific acts of the weak, he writes, “many everyday practices (talking, reading, moving about, shopping, cooking, etc.) are tactical in character. And so are, more generally, many “ways of operating”: victories of the “weak” over the “strong” (whether the strength be that of powerful people or the violence of things or of an imposed order, etc.), clever tricks, knowing how to get away with things, “hunter’s cunning,” maneuvers, polymorphic simulations, joyful discoveries, poetic  as well as warlike. The Greeks called these “ways of operating” metis (Ibid.). This reading gives an entirely different perspective on acts and themes of resistance as panoptical surveillance in the age of global neoliberalism becomes more totalitarian in nature at specific moments.

As a philosopher versed in analytic philosophy, truth is a primary concern of Wiredu and this concern is incorporated into his analysis of Marxist philosophy. Hence, he identifies the following points, “the cognition of truth is recognized by Engels as the business of philosophy; (2) What is denied is absolute truth, not truth as such; (3) The belief, so finely expressed, in the progressive character of truth; (4) Engels speaks of this process of cognition as the ‘development of science.’ (5) That a consciousness of limitation is a necessary element in all acquired knowledge” (Wiredu,1980:64-65). Wiredu explains that these various Marxian assertions on truth are no different from those of the logician, C. S. Peirce who had expounded them under a formulation he called “fallibilism.” John Dewey also expounded them under the concept of ‘pragmatism’(Ibid.67). So the point here is that some of the main Marxist propositions on truth have parallels in analytic philosophy. Nonetheless, this raises an unsettling question about Marxism and its relation to truth: “How is it that a philosophy which advocates such an admirable doctrine as the humanistic conception of truth tends so often to lead in practice to the suppression of freedom of thought and expression? Is it by accident that this comes to be so? Or is it due to causes internal to the philosophy of Marx and Engels”(Ibid.68). Wiredu demonstrates strong reservations about what Ernest Wamba dia Wamba calls ‘bureaucratic socialism.” Derrida on his part, urges us to distinguish between Marx as a philosopher and the innumerable specters of Marx. In other words, there is a difference between “the dogma machine and the “Marxist” ideological apparatuses (States, parties, cells, unions, and other places of doctrinal production)”(Derrida,1994:13)  and the necessity to treat Marx as a great philosopher. We need to “try to play Marx off against Marxism so as to neutralize, or at any rate muffle the political imperative in the untroubled exegesis of classified work” (Ibid.31).  We also need to remember that “he doesn’t belong to the communists, to the Marxists, to the parties, he ought to figure within our great canon of […] political philosophy” (Ibid.31).

Wiredu’s reading of Marxism generally is quite damaging. First, he states, “Engels himself, never perfectly consistent, already compromises his conception of truth with some concessions to absolute truth in Anti-Duhring” (Wiredu, 1980:68). He then makes an even more damaging accusation that a form of authoritarianism lies at the heart of conception of philosophy propagated by Marx and Engels.  On what he considers to a deep-seated confusion in their work, he writes, “Engels recognizes the cognition of truth to be a legitimate business of philosophy and makes a number of excellent points about truth. As soon, however, as one tries to find out what he and Marx conceived philosophy to be like, one is faced with a deep obscurity. The problem resolves round what one may describe as Marx’s conception of philosophy as ideology” (Ibid.70). Here, Wiredu makes the crucial distinction between Marx as a philosopher and the effects of his numerous spectralities and for this reason he offers his most important criticism of his general critique of Marxism. He also accuses Marx of instances of “carelessness in the use of cardinal terms” which he says “may be symptomatic of deep inadequacies of thought”(Ibid.74). This charge, which relates to Marx’s conception of consciousness is indeed serious since it borders on the question of conceptual clarification as advanced by the canon of analytic philosophy. Wiredu argues that Marx and Engels are unclear about their employment of the concept of ideology: “Marx and Engels are […] on the horns of a dilemma. If all philosophical thinking is ideological, then their thinking is ideological and, by their hypothesis, false”(Ibid.76). Wiredu’s insights are very important here: “He and Engels simply assumed for themselves the privilege of exempting their own philosophizing from the ideological theory of ideas”(Ibid.77). Consequently, Marx commits a grave error “in his conception of ideology and its bearing upon philosophy”(Ibid.81).

Another area Wiredu finds Marx and Engels wanting is moral philosophy. In other words, Marx “confused moral philosophy with moralism and assumed rather than argued a moral standpoint”(Ibid.79). Furthermore, he had precious little to say on the nature of the relationship between philosophy and morality. Engels does better on this score as there is a treatment of morality in Anti-Duhring. Nonetheless, Engels is charged with giving “no guidance on the conceptual problems that have perplexed moral philosophers” (Ibi.80). Henceforth, Wiredu becomes increasing dismissive of Marx, Marxism and its followers. First, he writes, “the run-of the-mill Marxists, even less enamoured of philosophical accuracy than their masters, have made the ideological conception of philosophy a battle cry”(Ibid.80). And then he singles out ‘scientific socialism’ which he regards as being unclear in its elaboration and which he typifies as “an amalgam of factual and evaluative elements blended together without regard to categorical stratification”(Ibid.85). In one of his most damaging assessments of Marxism, he declares: “Ideology is the death of philosophy. To the extent to which Marxism, by its own internal incoherences, tends to be transformed into an ideology, to that extent Marxism is a science of the unscientific and a philosophy of the unphilosophic” (Ibid.87).

In sum, Wiredu general attitude towards Marxism is one of condemnation. However, in the contemporary re-evaluations of Marxism a few discursive elements need to be clarified; the inclusion of the demarcation of Cold War and post Cold War assessments of Marxism ought to be employed as an analytical yardstick and also the necessity to sift through the various specters and legacies of Marx as distinct from those of Marxism. This is the kind of reading that Derrida urges us to do and it is also one to which we shall now turn our attention.

Derrida states it is imperative to distinguish between the legacies of Marx and the various spectralities of Marxism. In addition to this distinction we might add another crucial one: analyses of Marxism before and after the fall of the former Soviet Union. Wiredu’s critique is based on the pre-Soviet debacle whilst Derrida’s draws some of his reflections based on the post-Soviet fall. In these two different critiques, we must be careful to always strive to isolate the theoretical elements and insights that bypass short-lived discursive trends and political interests which often tend to vitiate the more profound effects of the works of Karl Marx and those that do not.

The debacle of the former Soviet Union and the apparent hegemony of neoliberal ideology have generated discourses associated with the “ends” of discourse. But Derrida points out that there is nothing new in the contemporary proclamations affirming the end of discourses which are in fact anachronistic when compared to the earlier versions of the same discursive orientation that emerged in the 1950s and which in a vital sense owed a great deal to a certain spirit of Marx: “the eschatological themes of the “end of history,” of the “end of Marxism,” of the “end of philosophy,” of the “ends of man,” of the “last man” and so forth were, in the ‘50s, that is, forty years ago our daily bread. We had this bread of apocalypse in our mouths naturally, already, just as naturally as that which I nicknamed after the fact, in 1980, the “apocalyptic tone in philosophy” (Derrida, 1994:14-15). In a way, in fact the contemporary discourses of endism that draw from the spirit of neoliberal triumphalism, without acknowledging it, are greatly indebted to Marxism and the more constructive critiques of it. Deconstruction, in part, emerged from the necessity to critique the various forms of statist Stalinism, the numerous socio-economic failings of Soviet bureaucracy and the political repression in Hungary. In other words, it emerged partly from the need to organize critiques for degraded forms of socialism.

In speaking about the inheritance of Marx, Derrida also reflects on the injunction associated with it. The task of reflecting on this inheritance and the injunction to which it gives rise is demanding: … “one must filter, sift, criticize, one must sort out several different possibles that inhabit the same injunction. And inhabit it in a contradictory fashion around a secret. If the readability of a legacy were given, natural, transparent, univocal, if it did not call for and at the same time defy interpretation, we would never have anything to inherit from it” (Ibid.16). Derrida’s employment of terms and phrases such “inheritance,” “injunction,” and the “spectrality of the specter” in relation to the legacies of Marx has to do with the question of the genius of Marx: “Whether evil or not, a genius operates, it always resists and defies after the fashion of a spectral thing. The animated work becomes that thing, the Thing that, like an elusive specter, engineers [s’ingenie] a habitation without proper inhabiting, call it is a haunting, of both memory and translation” (Ibid.18).

A work of genius, a masterpiece in addition to giving rise to spectralities also generates legions of imitators and followers. Of the Marxists who came after Marx, Wiredu writes; “I find that Marxists are especially prone to confuse factual with ideological issues. Undoubtedly, the great majority of those who call themselves Marxists do not share the ideology of Marx”(Wiredu,1980:94). In order to transcend the violence and confusion of Marxists who misread Marx, we need “to play Marx off against Marxism so as to neutralize, or at any rate muffle the political imperative in the untroubled exegesis of a classified work”(Derrida,1994:31). The work of re-reading Marx, of re-establishing his philosophical value and importance is a task needs to be performed in universities, conferences, colloquia and also in less academic sites and fora.

Within the contemporary cultural moment, new configurations have arisen that were not present during Marx’s day. Indeed, “a set of transformations of all sorts (in particular, techno-scientific-economic-media) exceeds both the traditional givens of the Marxist discourse and those of the liberal discourse opposed to it”(Ibid.70). Also,

Electoral representativity or parliamentary life is not only distorted, as was always the case, by a great number of socio-economic mechanisms, but it is exercised with more and more difficulty in a public space profoundly upset by techno-tele-media apparatuses and by new rhythms of information and communication, by the devices and the speed of forces represented by the latter, but also and consequently by the new modes of appropriation they put to work, by the new structure of the event and of its spectrality that they produce.” (Ibid.79)

Here, the instructive point is that the new information technologies have radically transformed the possibilities of the event and the modes of its production, reception and also interpretation. But there is a far more radical change that has occurred and which signals a profound crisis of global capitalism and the neoliberal ideology that underpins it: “For what must be cried out, at a time when some have the audacity to neo-evangelize in the name of the ideal of liberal democracy that has finally realized itself  as the ideal of human history: never have violence, inequality, exclusion, famine, and thus economic oppression affected as many human beings in the history of the earth and of humanity”(Ibid.85). Also, “never have so many men, women, and children been subjugated, starved, or exterminated on the earth.” (Ibid.)

So Derrida identifies a few new factors that need to be included in the critique of Marxism in the contemporary moment namely the phenomenon of spectralization caused by techno-science and digitalization, the weakening of the practice of liberal democracy and also the crises and multiple contradictions inherent in global capitalism. It is necessary to include another element into the present configuration which is the rise of political Islam as an alternative ideology, its subsequent fervent politicization and its Western reconstruction into an ideology of terror.

Wiredu’s reading of Marx focuses on the conceptual infelicities in the latter’s theorizations of notions such as “ideology,” “consciousness,” and “truth.” Wiredu also criticizes Marx’s project of moral philosophy or in fact the lack of it. On the whole, his reading isn’t complementary. Indeed, it amounts to a dismissal of Marx in spite of the attempt to read him without the obfuscations of innumerable legacies.

6. Conclusion

Arguably, Wiredu’s particular contribution to the debate on the origins, status, problematic and future of contemporary African philosophy resides in his formulations regarding his theory of conceptual decolonization. His approach in formulating this theory of discursive agency and more specifically philosophical practice involves the incorporation of a form bi-culturalism. In other words, his approach entails analyses of the canon of Western philosophy and also the manifestations of tribal cultures as a way of attaining a conceptual synthesis. Indeed, this schema involves a forceful element of bi-culturalism as a matter of logical consequence as well as a high level of [multi] bi-lingual competence. As such, it not only an exercise in conceptual synthesis but it is also a project involving comparative linguistics.

In Anglophone parts of Africa, Wiredu’s experience and research in teaching African philosophy has had a tremendous significance. The positive aspect of this is that the study of African philosophical thought has in positive moments transcended the problematic of identity or what has been termed as the problematic of origins. The less complimentary dimension of this equation is that Wiredu’s discoveries have given rise to (most undoubtedly unwittingly) a somewhat hegemonic school of disciples that is fostering a delimiting academicism and which is contrary to his essential spirit of conceptual inventiveness. As such, it might become necessary not only to critique Wiredu’s corpus but perhaps also Wiredu’s school of disciples which rather than appreciate the originality of his formulations fall instead for the pitfalls of over-ideologization.

Undoubtedly, Wiredu discovered a challenging path in modern African thought in which he sometimes takes the meaning of the existence of African philosophy for granted. In addition, it has been observed that also lacking at some moments in his oeuvre is an attempt to de-totalize and hence particularize the components of what he regards of the foundations of African philosophy.  In other words, African philosophy finds its form, shape and also its conceptual moorings above the discursive platform provided by Western philosophy. In addition, the theoretical space made available for its articulation is derived from the same Western-donated pool of unanimism. Part of recent interrogations of Wiredu’s work includes a questioning of the legitimacy of that space as the only site on which to construct an entire philosophical practice for the alienated, hybrid African consciousness. Oftentimes the question is posed, what are the ways by which the space can be broadened?

Indeed, terms such as reflective integration and due reflection offer the critical spaces for the theoretical articulation of something whose existence has not yet been concretely conceived. So in Wiredu’s corpus we see the very familiar problematic involving the tradition/modernity dichotomy being played out. Finally, it can be argued that this tension is not quite resolved but fortunately it is also a tension that never jeopardizes his philosophical inventiveness. Rather, it seems to animate his reflections in unprecedented ways.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Cronon, D. E. 1955. Black Moses: The Story of Marcus Garvey and the Universal Negro Improvement Association, Wisconsin: University of Wisconsin Press.
  • Cummings, Robert. 1986. “Africa between the Ages” in African Studies Review, Vol. 29, No. 3, September.
  • Diop, Cheikh, Anta, 1974. The African Origin of Civilization: Myth or Reality? Trans. M. Cook, Westport, Conn.: Lawrence Hill.
  • Doortmont, Michel R. 2005 The Pen-Pictures of Modern Africans and African Celebrities by Charles Francis Hutchison,  Leiden and Boston: Brill.
  • Dubow, Saul. 2000 The African National Congress, Johannesburg: Jonathan Ball.
  • Derrida, Jacques. 1994. Specters of Marx: the state of the debt, the work of mourning, & the new international, trans. Peggy Kamuf, New York: Routledge.
  • Gates Jr., H. L. 1992. Loose Canons, New York: OxfordUniversity Press.
  • Fanon, Frantz. 1967 Black Skin, White Masks (trans. C. Van Markmann) New York: Grove Press.
  • Fanon, Frantz. 1963 The Wretched of the Earth, London: Penguin.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1974 The Order of Things: An Archaeology of the Human Sciences. New York: Pantheon.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1977 Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison. Trans A. M. Sheridan-Smith. London: Allen Lane.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1980 Language, Counter-Memory and Practice. Selected Essays and Interviews. Ed. Donald Bouchard, Ithaca, NY: CornellUniversity Press.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1982 The Archaeology of Knowledge. New York: Pantheon.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1991 “Governmentality” in G. Burchell, C. Gordon and P. Miller, eds, The Foucault Effect.Chicago: Chicago University Press.
  • Hountondji, Paulin. 1983 African Philosophy: Myth and Reality, London: Hutchinson and Co.
  • Hountondji, Paulin.  2002 The Struggle for Meaning: Reflections on Philosophy, Culture and Democracy in Africa, Athens: Ohio University Center for International Studies.
  • Masolo, D.A. 1994 African Philosophy in Search of Identity Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Mudimbe V.Y. 1988 The Invention of Africa Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Mudimbe V.Y. 1994. The Idea of Africa,Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Oladipo,  Olusegun. ed. 2002  The Third Way in African Philosophy:Essays in Honour of Kwasi WireduIbadan: Hope Publications Ltd.
  • Osha, Sanya, 2005 Kwasi Wiredu and Beyond: The Text, Writing and Thought in Africa, Dakar: Codesria.
  • Soyinka, Wole, 1976 Myth, Literature and the African World Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole,   1988 Art, Dialogue and Outrage Ibadan: New Horn Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole, 1996 The Open Sore of a Continent New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole.  1999 The Burden of Memory, The Muse of Forgiveness New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole. 2000 “Memory, Truth and Healing” in The Politics of Memory, Truth, Healing and Social Justice, eds. I. Amaduime and A. An-Na’im, London: Zed Books
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1972 HomecomingLondon, Ibadan, Lusaka: Heinemann.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1981 Writers in PoliticsNairobi: Heinemann.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1986 Decolonising the MindNairobi: E.A.E.P.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1993 Moving the CentreLondon: James Currey.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. Philosophy and an African CultureCambridge: CambridgeUniversity Press, 1980.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi.  1983 “The Akan Concept of Mind” in Ibadan Journal of Humanistic Studies, No. 3.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1985 “The Concept of Truth in Akan Language” in P.O. Bodunrin ed. Philosophy in Africa: Trends and Perspectives, Ile-Ife: University of Ife Press.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. and Gyekye, Kwame. 1992 Persons and Community. Washington, D.C.: The Council for Research in Values and Philosophy.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1993 “Canons of Conceptualisation” in The Monist: An International Journal of General Philosophical Inquiry Vol. 76, No. 4 October.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1995 Conceptual Decolonization in African PhilosophyIbadan: Hope Publications.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi.  1996 Cultural Universals and ParticularsBloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Yai, Olabiyi. 1977 “The Theory and Practice in African Philosophy: The Poverty of Speculative Philosophy,” Second Order: An African Journal of Philosophy, Vol.VI, No.2.


Author Information

Sanya Osha
Tshwane University of Technology
South Africa


Cultural diversity has been present in societies for a very long time. In Ancient Greece, there were various small regions with different costumes, traditions, dialects and identities, for example, those from Aetolia, Locris, Doris and Epirus. In the Ottoman Empire, Muslims were the majority, but there were also Christians, Jews, pagan Arabs, and other religious groups. In the 21st century, societies remain culturally diverse, with most countries having a mixture of individuals from different races, linguistic backgrounds, religious affiliations, and so forth. Contemporary political theorists have labeled this phenomenon of the coexistence of different cultures in the same geographical space multiculturalism. That is, one of the meanings of multiculturalism is the coexistence of different cultures.

The term ‘multiculturalism’, however, has not been used only to describe a culturally diverse society, but also to refer to a kind of policy that aims at protecting cultural diversity. Although multiculturalism is a phenomenon with a long history and there have been countries historically that did adopt multicultural policies, like the Ottoman Empire, the systematic study of multiculturalism in philosophy has only flourished in the late twentieth century, when it began to receive special attention, especially from liberal philosophers. The philosophers who initially dedicated more time to the topic were mainly Canadian, but in the 21st century it is a widespread topic in contemporary political philosophy. Before multiculturalism became a topic in political philosophy, most literature in this area focused on topics related to the fair redistribution of resources; conversely, the topic of multiculturalism in the realm of political philosophy highlights the idea that cultural identities are also normatively relevant and that policies ought to take these identities into consideration.

To understand the discussion of multiculturalism in contemporary political philosophy, there are four key topics that should be taken into consideration; these are the meaning of the concept of ‘culture’, the meaning of the concept of ‘multiculturalism’, the debate about justice between cultural groups and the discussion regarding the practical implications of multicultural practices.

Table of Contents

  1. The Concepts of Culture in Contemporary Political Theory
    1. The Semiotic Perspective
    2. The Normative Conception
    3. The Societal Conception
    4. The Economic/Rational Choice Approach
    5. Anti-Essentialism and Cosmopolitanism
  2. The Concept of Multiculturalism
    1. Multiculturalism as a Describing Concept for Society
    2. Multiculturalism as a Policy
      1. Multicultural Citizenship
        1. Taylor's Politics of Recognition
        2. Kymlicka's Multicultural Liberalism
        3. Shachar's Transformative Accommodation
      2. Negative Universalism
        1. Barry's Liberal Egalitarianism
        2. Kukathas' Libertarianism
  3. The Second Wave of Writings on Multiculturalism
    1. Gays, Lesbians and Bisexuals
    2. Women
    3. Children
  4. Animals and Multiculturalism
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Concepts of Culture in Contemporary Political Theory

Multiculturalism is before anything else a theory about culture and its value. Hence, to understand what multiculturalism is it is indispensable that the meaning of culture is clarified. In this section, five concepts of culture that are predominant in contemporary political philosophy are outlined: semiotic, normative, societal, economic/rational choice and the anti-essentialist cosmopolitanism conceptions of culture. As Festenstein (2005) points out, these are not competing conceptions of culture, where each selects a distinct set of necessary and sufficient conditions for the right application of the predicate. Contrastingly, all these conceptions of culture defend, even though in slightly different ways, the idea that culture is constitutive of personal identity. Therefore, it is possible to simultaneously defend, say, a semiotic conception of culture and admit that a culture may have normative, societal, economic and cosmopolitan features.

a. The Semiotic Perspective

The semiotic conception of culture was very popular in the 1960s, and has its roots in classic social anthropology. Social anthropologists like Margaret Mead, Levi-Straus and Malinowski considered culture as a set of social systems, symbols, representations and practices of signification held by a certain group. Thus, from this perspective, a culture is defined as a system of ideals or structures of symbolic meaning. Put differently, according to this view, culture should be understood as a symbolic system which in turn is a way of communication which represents the world. This form of communication is based on symbols, underlying structures and beliefs or ideological principles. One of the philosophers endorsing this perspective of culture is Parekh (2005). According to Parekh (2005, p. 139), human life is organized by a historically created system of meaning and significance and in turn this is what we call culture.

Taylor (1994b) who contends that human beings are self-interpreting animals, that is, human beings’ identities depend on the way each individual sees them self, also endorses this viewpoint. These self-understandings necessarily have to have meaning. Hence, the thesis that human beings are self-interpreting animals presupposes that human existence is constituted by meaning. In turn, this implies that human beings are also language animals. By language, what is meant are all modes of expression (music, spoken language, art and so forth) (Taylor, 1994b). To be language animals means that individuals are capable of creating value and meaning, and in Taylor’s view, these meanings have their origins in each individual’s cultural community. That is to say, language is, at least primarily, a result of the interaction of individuals with their own cultural community (Taylor, 1974; 1994b). More precisely, linguistic meanings and self-interpretations have their origins in individuals’ linguistic communities. Thus, culture is a system of symbolic meaning.

Bearing this in mind, it can be argued that the study of culture from the semiotic perspective is the analysis or elucidation of meaning. As in hermeneutics, where the reader has to interpret the meaning of a text, in culture one has to interpret its internal logic (Festenstein, 2005). An example of interpreting the internal logic of a culture could be given by the story told by Quine (1960) regarding the native who says ‘Gavagai!’ whenever he sees a rabbit. Quine (1960) suggests that there may be multiple meanings associated with this actions; it may mean ‘rabbit’, ‘food’, ‘an undetached rabbit-part’, ‘there will be a storm tonight’ (if the native is superstitious) and so forth. The symbolism, sign process or system of meaning underlying this action is what, according to the point of view of semiotics, culture is, and this is what should be studied. In short, it is the study of culture’s autonomous logic.

b. The Normative Conception

The normative conception of culture is usually adopted by communitarians. From this point of view, culture is important because it is what provides beliefs, norms and moral reasons, prompting individuals to act. Hence, part of what a person is includes their moral commitments; their practical identity is made up of these moral commitments, while their reasons to act are motivated by their moral commitments. In other words, according to the normative conception of culture, the term ‘culture’ refers to a group of norms and beliefs that are distinctive and which constitute the practical identify of a group of individuals; thereby, people’s values and commitments result, in part, from culture (Festenstein, 2005, p. 14). By way of illustration, part of what a Christian, a Muslim and a Jew are is constituted by the fact they abide or follow the moral teachings of the Bible, the Quran and the Torah, respectively. Therefore, understanding who one is is about understanding one’s moral commitments and therefore culture is norm-providing. Shachar (2001a, p. 2) is one of the philosophers who endorses this conception of culture. According to her, culture is a world view, both comprehensive and distinguishable, whereby community law is able to be created. To minority groups that have a culture, Shachar (2001a, p.2) attaches the label ‘nomoi communities’. According to her, this term can apply to religious, ethnic, racial, tribal and national groups, for all these groups exhibit the normative dimension required to be classified as a ‘nomoi community’.

The normative conception of culture is usually associated with the semiotic, in the sense that one does not contradict the other; in fact, they may be complementary. For instance, Taylor endorses both perspectives of culture. However, this is not necessary because the system of meaning and significance does not need to provide moral reasons in order to motivate action. From the semiotic perspective, what someone is is not necessarily his or her moral commitments; it can be anything within the system. That is, the system of meaning may be based on anything while, according to the normative conception of culture, culture is strong source of one’s moral commitments.

To explain how the semiotic and normative conceptions of culture can be compatible, consider Taylor’s conception of culture. Taylor considers that individuals are self-interpreting animals. The fact that individuals are thus entails that human existence is constituted by meanings. From the normative point of view, these meanings are moral evaluations/strong evaluations. This refers to the distinctions of worth that individuals make regarding objects of desire. In other words, it is a background of distinctions between things that individuals consider important or worthy and those things which are considered less valuable. From the normative perspective of culture, individuals direct their lives and purposes towards what they consider morally worthwhile. In short, these strong evaluations or moral frameworks are what indicate to individuals what is meaningful and rewarding. That is, they are motivated by these evaluations (Taylor, 1974). Therefore, the self has a moral dimension, in the sense that rationality and identity refer to moral evaluations. Identity is connected with morality because what individuals are is constituted by their self-interpretations, which are ultimately provided by strong evaluations (Taylor, 1974). These moral beliefs or strong evaluations are in turn provided by an individual’s culture–that is why this can be considered a normative conception of culture.

c. The Societal Conception

The societal conception of culture is a concept mainly used by the Canadian philosopher Kymlicka. In order to understand this, it is helpful to consider Kymlicka’s dual typology of the sources of diversity that exist in contemporary societies; for Kymlicka there are two kinds of diversity: polyethnic minorities and national minorities.

Kymlicka uses the term polyethnicity to refer to the kind of diversity resulting from immigration. Polyethnic minorities refer to what is commonly defined as ethnic groups. According to him, polyethnic groups are usually not territorially concentrated; rather they are dispersed around the country to which they migrated. Furthermore, Kymlicka affirms that they do not usually want to be segregated from the culture of the majority; rather they want to integrate with it, demanding policies that give them equal citizenship. For instance, these groups demand language rights, voting rights, places in parliament and so forth. However, even though this demand for equal citizenship is usually what polyethnic groups aspire to, this is not always the case. Kymlicka contends that polyethnic groups can be sub-divided into liberal and illiberal groups (Kymlicka, 2001, pp. 55-58). Liberal polyethnic groups have aspirations that do not go against liberal values, usually aspiring to be integrated into society, demanding policies for equal citizenship. As an example, Kymlicka usually refers to Latin-American immigrants living in the United States, who, in broad terms, make demands for language rights, such as an education curriculum in Spanish.

On the other hand, for Kymlicka, illiberal polyethnic groups are those where the culture and the demands to the state are not in accordance with liberal values. For example, some religious minority ethnic groups advocate the death penalty for gays within their groups; others have gendered and discriminatory norms in relation to divorce and marriage. Some of these groups have demands that are more similar to the ones of national minorities but Kymlicka contends that these cases are the exception, not the rule (Kymlicka, 1995, pp. 11-26, 97-99).

Polyethnic groups are not, in Kymlicka’s view, considered a culture; according to him, only nations are a culture. Kymlicka (1995, p. 18) uses the term nation interchangeably with the terms culture, people and societal culture, for example, “I am using ‘a culture’ as synonymous with ‘a nation’ or ‘a people’—that is, as an intergenerational community, more or less institutionally complete, occupying a given territory or homeland, sharing a distinct language and history”. In Kymlicka’s view, national minorities are a group in a society with a societal culture and a smaller number of members than the majority. Hence, a national minority is a societal culture where the amount of members is smaller in number than the amount of members of the majority. For Kymlicka (1995, p. 76) a societal culture is a kind of social setting that provides individuals with meaningful ways of life, both in the public and private sphere. These societal cultures are important mainly because they give individuals the groundwork from which they can make choices. More precisely for Kymlicka (1995, p. 76) due to the fact that societal cultures provide meaningful ways of life, they provide the social context that individuals need in order to make their own choices (that is, to be autonomous). Kymlicka’s rationale is that autonomy is only possible in certain social contexts and that social context is set up by societal cultures.

From Kymlicka’s point of view, national minorities or minority societal cultures usually share a number of characteristics. First, national minorities have settled in the country long ago. For example, most of the Amish communities in Pennsylvania settled there in the eighteenth century, as a result of religious persecution in Europe. Aborigines in Australia and many Native American groups in the USA have lived in that territory for a long period. Second, from Kymlicka’s point of view, these groups are often territorially concentrated; for example, Quebec and Catalonia are situated in specific geographic areas of Canada and Spain, respectively. In India, Sikhs are geographically concentrated mostly in the Punjab region. Third, according to Kymlicka, the institutions and practices of these groups provide a full range of human activities; this means that nations are embodied in common economic, political and educational institutions. These institutions are not based only on shared meanings, memories and values but include common practices and procedures. Put differently, nations are institutionally complete in the sense that they encompass a wide institutional elaboration that encompasses a variety of areas of life; they have their own governments, laws, schools and so forth. In Kymlicka’s view, the fourth characteristic that national minorities have in common is that they usually aspire to either total or partial segregation from the larger society. That is, these groups wish to be a totally or partially separate society, with a different state, governed by their own laws and institutions. Hence, national minorities, in Kymlicka’s view, do not want to integrate in the larger society; rather they wish to be able to have a certain degree of autonomy. For example, many Quebecois want to be able to have their own government institutions, run in the way they wish, like schools run in French. Often, the Amish want to be left alone, without intervention from the state in their internal affairs. More precisely, one of the demands of some Amish communities is that they are exempt from the basic educational requirements that other citizens of the USA have to abide by, namely, the minimum literacy requirements. This, as will be explained later on, relates to other set of normative questions about what groups can and cannot impose to their members. In order to address this problem, Kymlicka draws a distinction between practices that can be imposed (external protections) and practices that cannot be imposed (internal restrictions).

From Kymlicka’s point of view, national minorities can further be sub-divided into liberal and illiberal minorities. The former are those whose demands are compatible with liberal values, that is, their demands do not violate individuals’ rights and liberties. Under the concept of liberal national minorities are examples like Quebecois and Catalonians; these national minorities usually demand the right to use a different language in schools and their other institutions, and this does not necessarily violate any liberal value. The concept of illiberal national minorities refers to groups that wish to endorse illiberal values, like the death penalty for gays and lesbians.

d. The Economic/Rational Choice Approach

Rational choice is a theory that aims to explain and predict social behavior. From the viewpoint of rational choice, individuals act self-interestedly when they take into consideration their preferences and the information available. Self-interest means that individuals tend to maximize what is valuable for them. In other words, human behavior is goal-oriented. It is goal oriented by its preferences, that is, individuals act according to their preferences. For instance, if an individual prefers a hot chocolate to a vanilla milkshake or a strawberry milkshake and all the options are available, he will choose hot chocolate (other things being equal).

According to the rational choice view, the information available strongly affects behavior. By way of illustration, if an individual does not know that hot chocolate is available he will not choose it. Thus individuals act according to their self-interest, information and preferences. If a certain person’s preference is to buy the tastiest hot chocolate and this person has the information that the tastiest hot chocolate is sold ina particular store, then this person will act in order to achieve her/his own interest, that is, by going to that store and purchasing it there. Obviously, these actions are limited by the options available and by the actions of others. Therefore, if there is no hot chocolate on the market, this person will not be able to buy it–the option is not available because the suppliers decided not to offer hot chocolate. In this sense, an individual’s are dependent on their circumstances and on the actions of others.

With these premises in mind, a possible definition of culture from a rational choice perspective is provided by Laitin (2007, p. 64), whereby culture is:

an equilibrium in a well-defined set of circumstances in which members of a group sharing in common descent, symbolic practices and/or high levels of interaction—and thereby becoming a cultural group—are able to condition their behavior on common knowledge beliefs about the behavior of all members of the group.

Therefore, there are four key features of this conception of culture. First, a cultural group is a group in which individuals share a certain number of characteristics that differentiate them from other individuals–for example, language or religion. Second, all these individuals share a high degree of common knowledge. What common knowledge means in this context is that the members of a certain culture have shared information and mutual expectations about the actions and beliefs of others in the group. Third, there is a cultural equilibrium when the incentive to act or the self-interest to act is according to the beliefs of his or her own culture. More precisely, a cultural equilibrium occurs when individuals’ have an interest in acting in accordance with the norms and practices of their culture. These norms and practices can be any, but Laitin (2007) provides an insightful example with respect to the old Chinese tradition of foot binding. Laitin explains that it was very difficult for Chinese women to marry a man if they did not engage in the foot binding tradition. In this case, most Chinese parents forced their daughters to engage in this practice owing to the fact that their interest in finding a husband to their daughters was in accordance with the cultural practice of foot binding.  Finally, a well-defined set of circumstances can be described as a kind of situation where the type of interactions that members have with each other are ones of coordination and not conflict. That is, individuals’ actions are ones that are arranged in a way that match or complement each other, rather than being in conflict.

e. Anti-Essentialism and Cosmopolitanism

The concepts of culture mentioned above have been strongly criticized by some political theorists. Some of these, who direct their criticisms mostly to the semiotic, normative and societal conceptions of culture, argue that these conceptions are essentialist views of culture that inaccurately describe social reality. However, as Festenstein (2005) has pointed out, these criticisms are sometimes misplaced, that is, these conceptions of culture do not necessarily need to be essentialist.

In general terms, from an essentialist point of view, there is a distinction between the essential and accidental properties that the different kinds of objects and subjects may have. Accidental properties are properties that are not necessarily present in all members of a certain group of objects or subjects. Essential properties are those that define the objects or subjects, that is, objects or subjects necessarily need to have these properties in order to be members of a certain group. Furthermore, members of other groups do not have this property or set of properties; otherwise they too would belong to this group. By way of illustration, a bookshelf in order to be a bookshelf has to necessarily be constructed in a way that makes it possible to hold books–this is its essential property. The fact that a specific bookshelf is brown, black or blue is an accidental property–it does not change what the object is and it is indifferent to its definition. These properties are necessary and sufficient not only to include a certain object or subject in the group but also to exclude any object or subject which does not share these properties. Bearing this in mind, it can be concluded that essences are given by differences and similarities; for what defines a subject is what it has in common with the subjects of the same group, which in turn is a characteristic that other groups do not have.

In terms of what this means to culture, it means identifying the social characteristics or attributes that make the group what it is, and that all members of that group necessarily share. Moreover, these characteristics are what differentiate members of that group from others and clearly exclude others (Young, 2000a, p. 87). For example, for an essentialist, to classify Muslims as Muslims means to identify a certain characteristic, like shared practices and beliefs, common to all of the individuals who identify as Muslims. Thus, essentialism applied to culture would be that a certain culture means having a certain characteristic or set of characteristics that all members share, and which no one outside the group does. Hence, from this point of view, the identity of the group is constituted by the set of properties or attributes which are essential to this particular group (Young, 2000a).

According to the critics of essentialism, this theory necessarily makes two wrong assumptions about culture. First, the critics state that essentialists wrongly affirm that cultures are clearly demarcated wholes and their practices and beliefs do not overlap with other cultures. Thus, according to this argument, essentialists wrongly affirm that beliefs and practices are exclusive to each culture. This premise is necessary for defending essentialism because from an essentialist point of view; different groups cannot share the same essential properties; otherwise they would belong to the same group. Second, essentialists, according to these critics, wrongly picture cultures as internally uniform or homogeneous. Put differently, essentialists consider that individuals with the same culture all agree and interpret practices in the same way. Furthermore, they all place the same value on the practices of the group. This second premise is necessary for essentialist thinking owing to the fact that a group has to have a property or a set of properties that is predicated of all individuals in order for them to be members of this group.

This essentialist perspective of culture has however been widely contested. The general argument is that essentialism stereotypes and makes abusive generalizations of what groups are. That is to say, according to the critics, essentialism is descriptively inaccurate. Criticism of this perspective contends that the first premise lacks empirical evidence. There is no evidence that there is any exclusivity in terms of practices and beliefs, in fact, evidence suggests the opposite; cultures borrow practices and beliefs in order to increase their fitness. Cultures are not bounded, owing to the fact that culture is constantly changing, influenced by local, national and global resources (Phillips, 2007a; 2010). Hence, according to this view, it is not possible to clearly demarcate the boundaries of cultures because they share a number of practices and beliefs. There is significant overlapping of cultures, especially in neighboring cultures. The distinction between cultures is, therefore, overemphasized–the boundaries between cultures not being clearly demarcated (Benhabib, 2002; Phillips, 2007a).

With regards to the second premise, the criticism contends that it is false to say that there is internal homogeneity inside a group in terms of needs, interests and beliefs. Rather, the social actors of cultural groups have different needs, interests and interpretations about the beliefs and practices of groups. Furthermore, in many cases, they consider these practices and beliefs quite contestable, discussable and open to different interpretations. Therefore, there is wide disagreement about cultural meaning (Benhabib, 2002). Anti-essentialists contend that there are too many exceptions to make essentialist claims. Therefore, there are a considerable number of counter-examples to this generalization (Phillips, 2007a; 2010; Schachar, 2001a). As a consequence, some anti-essentialists usually argue that these categories should be substituted by thinner categories. Thus, rather than speaking about women, one should speak about black women, or lesbian Muslim women.

Taking this into consideration, different, more flexible conceptions of culture have been suggested; perhaps the most well-known being the cosmopolitan conception of culture, defended by Waldron. In Waldron’s view, cultures are dynamic and in continuous creation and interchange (Waldron, 1991). Consequently, cultures overlap with each other, making it impossible to attribute exclusive properties to one single culture and to differentiate between them. In other words, according to this view, there is a mélange of cultures because people move between cultures by enjoying the opportunities that each provides. Hence, individuals live in a kaleidoscope of cultures, within which they enjoy and borrow practices (Waldron, 1996).

A question that arises is whether this criticism entails that any attempt to define culture is mistaken. Some anti-essentialists like Narayan (1998) contend that this is not the case. Rather, she contends that cultures can be defined if two points are taken into consideration. First, cultures are fluid and constantly changing; hence, any definition of culture should consider that cultures are always in flux. Second, broader categories should be substituted by thinner categories. This means that rather than using terms like ‘African Culture’, one should use terms like ’Tutsi culture in Rwanda’.

2. The Concept of Multiculturalism

In general terms, within contemporary political philosophy, the concept of multiculturalism has been defined in two different ways. Sometimes the term ‘multiculturalism’ is used as a descriptive concept; other times it is defined as a kind of policy for responding to cultural diversity. In the next section, the definition of multiculturalism as a descriptive concept will be explained, followed by a clarification of what it means to use the term ‘multiculturalism’ as a policy.

a. Multiculturalism as a Describing Concept for Society

The term ‘multiculturalism’ is sometimes used to describe a condition of society; more precisely, it is used to describe a society where a variety of different cultures coexist. Many countries in the world are culturally diverse. Canada is just one example, including a variety of cultures such as English Canadians, Quebecois, Native Americans, Amish, Hutterites and Chinese immigrants. China is another country that can also be considered culturally diverse. In contemporary China, there are 56 officially recognized ethnic groups, and 55 of these groups are ethnic minorities who make up approximately 8.41 percent of China’s overall population. The other ethnic group is that of Han Chinese, which holds majority status (Han, 2013; He, 2006).

There are a variety of ways whereby societies can be diverse, for example, culture can come in many forms (Gurr, 1993, p. 3). Perhaps the chief ways in which a country can be culturally diverse is by having different religious groups, different linguistic groups, groups that define themselves by their territorial identity and variant racial groups.

Religious diversity is a widespread phenomenon in many countries. India can be given as an example of a country which is religiously diverse, including citizens who are Sikhs, Hindus, Buddhists, among other religious groups. The US is also religiously diverse, including Mormons, Amish, Hutterites, Catholics, Jews and so forth. These groups differentiate from each other via a variety of factors. Some of these are the Gods worshiped, the public holidays, the religious festivals and the dress codes.

Linguistic diversity is also widespread. In the 21st century, there are more than 200 countries in the world and around 6000 spoken languages (Laitin, 2007). Linguistic diversity usually results from two kinds of groups. First, it results from immigrants who move to a country where the language spoken is not their native language (Kymlicka, 1995). This is the case for those Cubans and Puerto Ricans who immigrated to the United States; it is also the case for Ukrainian immigrants who moved to Portugal.

The second kind of groups that are a cause of linguistic diversity are national minorities. National minorities are groups that have either settled in the country for a long time, but do not share the same language with the majority. Some examples include Quebecois in Canada, Catalans and Basques in Spain, and the Uyghur in China. Usually, these linguistic groups are territorially concentrated; furthermore, minority groups that fall into this category usually demand a high degree of autonomy. In particular, minority groups usually demand that they have the regional power to self-govern, that is, to run their territory as if it was an independent country or to succeed and become a different country.

A third kind of group diversity can results from distinct territory location. This territory location does not necessary mean that members of distinct cultures are, in fact, different. That is, it is not necessary that habits, traditions, customs, and so forth are significantly different. However, these distinct groups identify themselves as different from others because of the specific geographical area in which they are located. Possibly, in the UK, this is what distinguishes Scots from English. Even though there are historical differences between Scots and English, if one assumes that these two groups have little to distinguish themselves from each other, other than their geographical location, they would fit this third kind of group diversity. As mentioned above, these differences are conceptual and, in practice, cultural groups are characterized by a variety of features and not just one.

The fourth kind of group diversity is race. Races are groups whose physical characteristics are imbued with social significance. In other words, race is a socially constructed concept in the sense that it is the result of individuals giving social significance to a set of characteristics they consider that stand out in a person's physical appearance, such as skin color, eye color, hair color, bone/jaw structure and so forth. However, the mere existence of different physical characteristics does not mean that there is a multicultural environment/society. For instance, it cannot be affirmed that Sweden is multicultural because there are Swedes with blue eyes and others with green. Physical characteristics create a multicultural environment only when these physical characteristics mean that groups strongly identify with their physical characteristics and where these physical characteristics are socially perceived as something that strongly differentiates them from other groups. That is, racial cultural diversity is not simply the existence of different physical characteristics. Rather, these different physical characteristics must entail a sense of common identity which, in turn, are socially perceived as something that differentiates the members of that group to others. However, many times this idea of common identity is exaggerated, as Waldron’s argument suggests. For instance, even though there is the idea that a black culture exists in the United States, Appiah (1996) denies that such black culture exists, since there is no common identity among blacks in the United States. An example of a physical difference that is considered socially significant and, therefore, creates a multicultural society/environment can be seen in the Tutsis and Hutus of Rwanda. In general terms, Tutsis and Hutus are very similar, due to the fact that they speak the same language, share the same territory and follow the same traditions. Nevertheless, Tutsis are usually taller and thinner than Hutus. The social significance given to these physical differences are sufficient for members of both groups, broadly speaking, to identify as members of one group or the other, and subsequently oppose to each other.

Obviously, groups are not, most of the time, identified only by being linguistically different, territorially concentrated or religiously distinct. In fact, most groups have more than one of these characteristics. For instance, Sikhs in India, besides being religiously different, are also characterized, in general terms, by their geographical location. Namely, they are localized in the Punjab region of India. The Uyghur, from China, have a different language, are usually Muslims and are usually located in Xinjiang. Thus, the classification is helpful for understanding the characteristics of each group, but does not mean that these groups are simply defined by that characteristic.

b. Multiculturalism as a Policy

The term ‘multiculturalism’ can also be used to refer to a kind of policy. This kind of policy has two main characteristics. First, it aims at addressing the different demands of cultural groups. That is, it is a kind of policy that refers to the different normative challenges (ethnic conflict, internal illiberalism, federal autonomy, and so forth) that arise as a result of cultural diversity. For example, these are policies that aim at addressing the different normative challenges that arise from minority groups, like Quebecois, wishing to have their own institutions in a different language from the rest of Canada. To contrast with redistributive policies, multicultural policies are not primarily about distributive justice, that is, who gets what share of resources, although multicultural policies may refer to redistribution accidentally (Fraser, 2001). Multicultural policies aim at correcting the kind of disadvantages that some individuals are victims of, and that result from these individuals’ cultural identity. For instance, these are policies that aim at correcting a disadvantage that may result from someone being a member of a certain religion. In the case of some Muslims, this can mean addressing the problem of Muslims living in a Christian country and demanding different public holidays than the majority to celebrate their own festivals such as Eid-al-Fitr.

Second, multicultural policies are policies that aim at providing groups the means by which individuals can pursue their cultural differences. Put differently, multicultural policies have as their objectives, the preservation, allowance or celebration of differences between different groups. Consequently, multicultural policies contrast with assimilation. That is, according to the assimilationist view, it is acceptable that people are different, but the final goal of policies should be to make the minority group become part of the majority group, that is, to be accepted by those in the majority group, and to somehow find a consensus position between different cultures. Contrastingly, multiculturalism acknowledges that people have different ways of life and, in general terms, the state ought not to assimilate these groups but to give them the tools for pursuing their own ways of life or culture. That is, from a multiculturalist point of view, the final objective of policies is neither the standardization of cultural forms nor any form of uniformity or homogeneity; rather, its objective is to allow and give the means for groups to pursue their differences.

According to Kymlicka, in the context of contemporary liberal political philosophy, there have been two waves of writings on multiculturalism (Kymlicka, 1999a). This discussion of what policies ought to be undertaken in order to protect minority cultures is included in what Kymlicka called the first wave of the wave of writings on multiculturalism. In his view (1999a, p. 112), the first wave of writing focused on assessing to what extent it is just, from a liberal point of view, to give rights to groups so that they can pursue their cultural differences. In this first wave of writings, contemporary liberal political philosophers have discussed what kind of inequalities exist between majorities and minorities, and how these should be addressed. In other words, the discussion has been about what kind of intergroup inequalities exist, and what the state should do about them. In general terms, contemporary liberal political philosophers who have written about this topic have taken two different stands. On the one hand, some liberal political philosophers defend that state institutions should be blind to difference and that individuals should be given a uniform set of rights and liberties. In these authors’ views, cultural diversity, religious freedom and so forth are sufficiently protected by these sets of rights and liberties, especially by freedom of association and conscience. Therefore, those who stand for a uniform set of rights and liberties contend that ascribing rights on the basis of membership in a group is a discriminatory and immoral policy that creates citizenship hierarchies that are undesirable and unjust (Kymlicka, 1999a, pp. 112-113). Thus, in the view of these contemporary liberal philosophers, involvement in the cultural character of society is something that the state is under the duty to not do.

On the other hand, some philosophers have taken the opposite view on this matter. For example, there are some contemporary liberal political philosophers who are more sympathetic to the idea of ascribing rights to groups and have defended difference-sensitive policies. As Kymlicka (1999a, p. 112) points out, these contemporary liberal political philosophers have tried to show that difference-sensitive rules are not inherently unjust. In general terms, these contemporary political philosophers argue that a regime of difference-sensitive policies does not necessarily entail a hierarchization of citizenship and unfair privileges for some groups. Rather, they argue that difference-sensitive policies aim at correcting intergroup inequalities and disadvantages in the cultural market. Moreover, some of these philosophers contend that difference-blind policies favor the needs, interests and identities of the majority (Kymlicka, 1999a, pp. 112-114). These philosophers who consider that groups are entitled to special rights can be classified as a form of multicultural citizenship.

Those who defend special rights for groups have suggested a variety of policies. In his book The Multiculturalism of Fear, Levy (2000, pp. 125-160) systematically exposed the kinds of difference-sensitive policies that are usually discussed in the literature. According to him, difference-sensitive policies can be divided into eight categories: exemptions, assistance, symbolic claims, recognition/enforcement, special representation, self-government, external rules and internal rules.

Exemptions to laws are usually rights based on a negative liberty of non-interference from the state in a specific affair, which would cause a significant burden to a certain group. Or, to put it another way, exemptions to the law happen when the state abstains from interfering with or obliging a certain group who desire to practice something in order to diminish their burden. Exemptions can also be a limitation of someone else’s liberty to impose some costs on a certain group. Imagine that there is a general law that decrees corporations have the right to impose a dress code upon their employees. However, having this general law would burden those groups for whom dressing in a certain manner (that is, different from the one required by the company) is a very important value. For example, for many Sikh men and Muslim women it is very important to wear turbans and headscarves, respectively. Hence, it can be claimed that giving these individuals the option of either finding another job or rejecting their dress code can be a significant burden to them; given that the choice of dressing in a certain way is sometimes much harder for Sikh men and Muslim women than for a Westerner, and that it would undermine their identity, an exemption may be justified (Levy, 2000, pp. 128-133). Hence, these groups would be able to engage in practices that are not allowable for the majority of citizens.

Assistance rights aim to aid individuals in overcoming the obstacles they face because they belong to a certain group. In other words, assistance rights aim to rectify disadvantages experienced by certain individuals, as a result of their membership of a certain group, when compared to the majority. This can mean funding individuals to pursue their goals or using positive discrimination to help them in a variety of ways. Language rights are an example of this approach. Suppose that some individuals from Catalonia cannot speak Spanish. An assistance measure would be having people speak both Spanish and Catalan at public institutions, so that they can serve people from the minority as well the minority language group. Another example would be awarding subsidies to help groups preserve their cohesion by maintaining their practices and beliefs, and by allowing individuals from a minority to participate in public institutions as full citizens. Most of these practices are temporary, but they do not need to be (language rights, for example, are often not temporary) (Levy, 2000, pp. 133-137).

Symbolic claims refer to problems which do not affect individuals’ lives directly or seriously, but which may make the relations between individuals from different groups better. In a multicultural country, where there are multiple religions, ethnicities and ways of life, it may not make sense to have certain symbols that represent only a specific culture. Symbolic claims are ones that require, on the grounds of equality, the inclusion of all the cultures in a specific country in that country’s symbols. An example would be including Catholic, Sikh, Muslim, Protestant, Welsh, Northern Irish, Scottish, and English symbols on both the British flag and in the national anthem. Not integrating minority symbols may be considered as dispensing a lack of respect and unequal treatment to minorities.

Recognition is a demand for integrating a specific law or cultural practice into the larger society. If individuals want to integrate a specific law, they can ask for the law to become part of the major legal system. Hence, Sharia law could form part of divorce law for Muslims, while Aboriginal law could run in conjunction with Australian property rights law. It could also be a requirement to include certain groups in the history books used in schools–for example, to include the history of Indian and Pakistani immigrants in British history textbooks. Failing to integrate this law may bring a substantive burden to bear on individuals’ identity. In the Muslim case, because family law is of crucial importance to their identity, they may be considerably burdened by having to abide by a Western perspective of divorce. With regards to Aboriginal law, because hunting is essential for their way of life, if other individuals own the(ir) land this may undermine the Aboriginal culture.

Special representation rights are designed to protect groups which have been systematically unrepresented and disadvantaged in the larger society. Minority groups may be under-represented in the institutions of a society, and in order to place them in a position of equal bargaining power, it is necessary to provide special rights to the members of these groups. Hence, these rights aim to defend individuals’ interests in a more equal manner by guaranteeing some privileges or preventing discrimination. One way to achieve this is by setting aside extra seats for minorities in parliament (Kymlicka, 1995, pp. 131-152; Levy, 2000, pp. 150-154).

Self-government rights are usually what are claimed by national minorities (for example, Pueblo Indians and Quebecois) and they usually demand some degree of autonomy and self-determination. This sometimes implies demands for exclusive occupation of land and territorial jurisdiction. The reason groups sometimes may need these rights is that the kind of autonomy they give is a necessary condition by which individuals can develop their cultures, which is in the best interest of a culture’s members. More precisely, a specific educational curriculum, language right or jurisdiction over a territory may be a necessary requirement for the survival and prosperity of a particular culture and its members. This is compatible with both freedom and equality; it is compatible with freedom because it allows individuals access to their culture and to make their own choices; it is consistent with equality because it places individuals on an equal footing in terms of cultural access (Kymlicka, 1995, pp. 27-30; Levy, 2000, pp. 137- 138).

What Levy classifies as external rules can be considered as kinds of rights for self-government. They involve restricting other people’s freedom in order to preserve a certain culture. Hence, Aborigines in Australia employ external safeguards to protect their land. For example, freedom of movement is limited to outsiders who circulate in Aboriginal territory; furthermore, outsiders do not have the right to buy Aboriginal land. Demands that groups make for internal rules are those demands that aim at restricting individuals’ behavior within the group. Stigmatizing, ostracizing or excommunicating individuals from groups because they have not abided by the rules is what is usually meant by internal rules. Thus, this is the power given to groups to treat their members in a way that is not acceptable for the rest of society. An example can be if a certain individual marries someone from another group, which may then mean he is expelled from his own group. Another case is that of the Amish who want their children to withdraw from school earlier than the rest of society. In contrast to external rules, the restrictions on freedom apply to members of the group and not to outsiders. It is controversial whether internal rules are compatible with liberal values or not. On the one hand, authors like Kymlicka affirm they are not, because they undermine individuals’ autonomy, which is, in his view, a central liberal value. On the other hand, philosophers like Kukathas contend that liberals are committed to tolerance and, thereby, should accept some internal restrictions.

i. Multicultural Citizenship

Generally speaking, the philosophy of those authors who defend a multicultural citizenship, have five points in common. Firstly, they all contend that the state has the duty to support laws which defend the basic legal, civil and political rights of its citizens. Secondly, they argue that the state should participate in the construction of societal cultural character, thus its laws and policies should aim to protect culture. Thirdly, these philosophers contend that the character of culture is normative. Consequently, and this is the fourth common feature, individuals’ interest in culture is sufficiently strong enough that it needs to be supported by the state. Fifth, they both defend difference-sensitive/multicultural citizenship policies for protecting culture. Some of the philosophers who defend a multicultural citizenship are Taylor, Kymlicka and Shachar.

1. Taylor's Politics of Recognition

According to Taylor, there are two forms of recognition; intimate recognition and public recognition. Taylor (1994b, p. 37) mainly discusses the idea of public recognition or recognition in the public sphere. This form of recognition is about respect and esteem for one’s identity in the public realm; being misrecognized in the public realm means to have one’s identity disrespected in a way whereby one is treated as a second-class citizen. Being misrecognized, in this sense, is to have an unequal citizenship status in virtue of one’s identity. Hence, someone is misrecognized in the public sphere if one has a legal disadvantage that results from one’s identity. To have respect and esteem for someone in the public sphere means to have citizenship rights that do not disadvantage one’s identity. In Taylor’s view, misrecognition can potentially be a form of oppression and helps to create self-hating images in those who are misrecognized. Bearing this in mind, recognition is a vital human need because the relation between recognition and identity (the way people understand who they are) is relatively strong; hence, misrecognition or non-recognition may have a serious harmful effect on individuals

In order to discuss the best way to achieve recognition in the public realm, Taylor draws a distinction between procedural and non-procedural forms of liberalism. He affirms that, according to the procedural version of liberalism, a just society is one where all individuals have a uniform set of rights and freedoms, and having different rights for different people creates distinctions between first-class and second-class citizens: this liberalism is only committed to individual rights and rejects the idea of collective rights. The state, according to this version of liberalism, should not be involved in the cultural character of society and the procedures of this society must be independent of any particular set of values held by the citizens of that polity. In other words, the state should be neutral and independent of any conception of the good life.

In Taylor’s (1994b, p. 60) view, procedural liberalism is inhospitable to difference and is unable to accommodate different cultures. Taylor believes that, in some cases, collective goals need to be aided so that they can be achieved. Sometimes cultural communities need to have power over certain jurisdictions so that they can promote their own culture; this is something that a procedural liberalism does not offer, according to Taylor. Due to the fact that Taylor considers recognition as important, this kind of liberalism that is inhospitable to difference should be rejected; rather, in Taylor’s view, a non-procedural liberalism that is involved in the cultural character of society in a way that enhances cultural diversity and is not hostile to difference is the kind of liberalism that should be endorsed. From Taylor’s point of view, this non-procedural liberalism is not neutral between different ways of life and it is grounded in judgments of what the good life is. According to Taylor, this liberalism takes into account differences between individuals and groups and by taking these into account it creates an environment that is not hostile to the flourishing of different cultures. Engaging in policies that promote culture is, in Taylor’s view, extremely important; cultural communities deserve protection owing to the fact that they provide members with the basis of their identities. The language of cultures provides the framework for the question of who one is. Taylor believes that identity is strongly influenced by culture; therefore, there is a moral and social framework given by the language of one’s culture that individuals need in order to make sense of their lives. Therefore, recognition and protection of individuals’ cultural communities is required for respecting and preserving one’s identity. However, in Taylor’s view, this commitment to promoting difference is acceptable only if the measures taken to promote difference are constant with what he considers to be fundamental rights. Taylor specifically mentions the rights to life, liberty, due process, free speech and free practice of religion.

From Taylor’s point of view, this non-procedural liberalism has implications for public policy. It means that there should be decentralized power so that communities can flourish. However, what this decentralization and non-procedural liberalism imply in practice depends on the context; in different countries with different kinds of minorities there may be different implications. Taylor mostly writes about the Canadian context and he believes that in this context the best policy is a form of federalism. In his view, Quebec should be given self-government rights so that it has power over a certain number of policies. In particular, Taylor affirms that it should have sovereign power over art, technology, economy, labor, communications, agriculture, and fisheries. In the case of language policies, Taylor contends that in some cases it is justified to violate liberal values, like freedom of expression, in order to protect the language of a community. For instance, in the case of Quebec, communications in English can be restricted by the state in order to promote the French language.  Another example is that offspring of French parents do not have the option of choosing a language of instruction that is not French. Moreover, it should have shared power with the majority in immigration, industrial policy and environmental policy. Control over defense, external affairs and currency is given to the federal government. It is important to emphasize that, in Taylor’s view, federalism is not a necessary implication of non-procedural liberalism. Federalism is not at the core of the recognition idea; rather, federalism is a kind of system that Taylor considers is the adequate option in the Canadian context, which does not mean it is a good option in all contexts.

2. Kymlicka's Multicultural Liberalism

Kymlicka believes that group rights are compatible and promote the liberal values of freedom and equality. As a result, Kymlicka offers arguments that relate freedom and equality with group rights. The argument based on freedom is strongly related to his idea of societal culture. In Kymlicka’s perspective (1995, p. 80), societal cultures promote freedom. From Kymlicka’s point of view, the reason why societal cultures are important for freedom is because they give individuals the groundwork from which they can make choices. In particular, according to Kymlicka, because societal cultures provide a framework with meaningful ways of life, then they provide the social conditions that are necessary for individuals to make autonomous choices. Autonomy, in turn, is only possible if and only if these social conditions are the ones of individuals’ societal cultures.

Taking this on board, Kymlicka’s argument is that societal cultures ought to be protected because they promote the liberal value of autonomy; they promote this value because societal cultures give, in Kymlicka’s perspective, a context of choice that is necessary for individuals to exercise their freedom. Put differently, from Kymlicka’s point of view, individuals’ own cultures provide the groundwork that individuals need in order to make free choices. Consequently, if liberals are committed to this value, they are committed to protecting the conditions (societal cultures) to achieve it. This means that if group rights are necessary for protecting this context of choice, then they are justified from a liberal point of view; for if group rights can protect the context of choice, then they are promoting autonomy. As mentioned above, from the three sources of diversity only national minorities have societal cultures. Hence, this argument only justifies group rights for national minorities in order to protect their societal cultures. In Kymlicka’s view, the context of choice is given by the access to one’s own culture, not just to any culture. So according to this view, for someone from Quebec, the societal culture of Catalonia does not provide a context of choice; likewise, for someone from an Amish community, the societal culture of Sikhs in India does not provide this Amish individual with a context of choice.

The three arguments based on equality that Kymlicka offers for defending group rights rely on a different line of reasoning. The first argument starts by observing that there is an inevitable involvement in the cultural character of society by the state and it is impossible to be completely neutral. Kymlicka affirms that the decisions made by governments, like what public holidays to have, unavoidably promote a certain cultural identity. Consequently, those individuals who do not share the culture promoted by the state are disadvantaged. In other words, they are in an unequal position. More precisely, by observing the unequal treatment that results from the inevitable involvement in the cultural character of society by the state, Kymlicka contends that uniform laws giving the same rights to all individuals from different cultures treat individuals unequally. To take the example of public holidays, the establishment of Christian public holidays disadvantages Muslims because their main festival, Eid-al-Fitr, occurs at a time of the year when there are no public holidays. Bearing this in mind, Kymlicka argues that if liberals are committed to equality, then they should endorse a kind of public policy that does not advantage some individuals over others; this, in turn, means that in order to equalize the status of different groups, the state ought to entitle different groups to different rights.

In Kymlicka’s view, group rights can correct these inequalities by providing the necessary and sufficient means by which individuals can pursue their culture. Although the argument for autonomy only applies to national minorities, this argument based on equality refers to national minorities and polyethnic groups. Inequalities between majorities and national minorities can take many shapes, but an example that Kymlicka likes to use is language rights inequalities. From his point of view, national linguistic minorities like those of Quebec and Catalonia would be treated unequally if they did not have the right to have their own institutions in their national language. The debate about Christian and Muslim holidays is an example of inequalities between majorities and polyethnic groups. Taking this on board, it is Kymlicka’s (1995) conviction that the two kinds of diversity can potentially be treated unequally by a set of uniform laws. As a result, any of these three kinds of diversity are entitled to group rights on grounds of promoting equality between groups within a liberal state.

Kymlicka’s second argument based on equality is that if it is the case that all individuals in society should have it, then the state is committed to promote a variety of cultures so that individuals have more options relating to choice. This argument, however, is not directed at minorities but rather at majorities, and it does not refer to a need of the minority; instead, it refers to how culture can make individuals’ lives better in general, by providing more options. Furthermore, Kymlicka (1995, p. 121) considers that because it is difficult to change one’s culture, this would not be a very attractive choice for everyone.

The third argument is that, according to Kymlicka, liberals should respect historical agreements. In Kymlicka’s view, many of the rights that minority cultures have in the early 21st century are the result of historical agreements. If the state is to treat individuals from different cultures with equal respect, then it should respect these agreements.

3. Shachar's Transformative Accommodation

Shachar is another philosopher who has defended a kind of multicultural citizenship. Shachar endorses a joint governance model that she calls transformative accommodation. According to Shachar, this model relies on four assumptions. First, individuals have a multiplicity of identities. For example, Malcolm X was a Muslim, a male, an African-American, and a heterosexual. Hence, individuals have a multiplicity of affiliations that play a role in their identities. The second assumption is that both the group and the state have normative and legal reasons to shape behavior. There may be a variety of reasons for this, but at least one of them is that individuals have a strong interest both in preserving their cultures and protecting their individual rights. Third, both what the state and the group do impact on each other. For instance, the laws that the state makes about same-sex marriage has an impact on heterosexist minority groups; the heterosexism of minority groups, like the hate speech of the Westboro Baptist Church, also impacts on the state. Fourth, both the state and the group have an interest in supporting their members (Shachar, 2001a, p. 118).

On top of these four assumptions, transformative accommodation is based on three core principles; sub-matter allocation of authority, no monopoly, and the clear establishment of delineated options (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 118-119). According to the sub-matters allocation of authority principle, the holistic view that contested social arenas (family law, criminal law, employment law and so forth) are indivisible is incorrect. According to this principle, these social arenas can be divisible into sub-matters, that is, into multiple separable components that are complementary (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 51-54). In practice, this means that norms and decisions about disputed social matters can be determined separately. In other words, in each area of law, there are sub-areas and these sub-areas are partially independent; as a result, a decision made in a sub-area can be made independently of a decision made in another sub-area. In Shachar’s view, family law, for example, can be divided into demarcating and distributive sub-matters or sub-areas. In her (2001a, pp. 119-120) view, the demarcating sub-matter of family law is where group membership boundaries are defined. That is, it is in this sub-matter that the necessary and sufficient attributes (biological, ethnical, territorial, ideological and so forth) for membership are decided. The distributive sub-matter refers to the distribution of resources. For instance, it would be in the demarcating sub-matter where it would be decided who gets what after divorce.

To illustrate how this principle would work in practice, Shachar routinely uses a legal dispute that occurred with a Native-American tribe and one of their members. This is the case of Julia Martinez; Julia Martinez, was a member of the Santa Clara Pueblo tribe whose daughter’s membership of the group was rejected, a rejection leading to tragic consequences. In 1941, Julia Martinez, who was a daughter of members of the Santa Clara Pueblo tribe married a man from outside the group. With this man, she had a daughter, who was raised in the Pueblo reservation, subsequently participating in and learning the norms and practices of the tribe. However, according to this tribe’s law, only the offspring of male members are considered members; hence, although Julia Martinez’ daughter was raised on the reservation, she was not, in the eyes of the tribe leaders, a tribe member. When Julia Martinez’s daughter got ill, she had to go to the emergency section of the Indian Health Services. Nevertheless, she was refused emergency treatment on grounds of not being a member of the tribe; a refusal that later caused her death (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 18-20). According to the sub-matters principle, in the case of the Santa Clara Pueblo tribe, it would be the legislators in the demarcation sub-matter who would determine whether Julia Martinez’s daughter was a member of the tribe or not (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 52-54). Contrastingly, it would be in the distributive sub-matter would that her entitlement or not to use the Indian Health Services would be decided.

By establishing the second principle, the no monopoly rule, Shachar defends that jurisdictional powers should be divided between the state and the group. According to this principle, neither the state nor the group should hold absolute power over the contested social arenas. More precisely, the group should hold power over one sub-matter while the state should hold power over another. Consequently, legal decisions would result from an interdependent and cooperative relationship between the group and the state (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 120-122). In the case of family law, if there is a divorce dispute, the state could take control of distribution (for example, property division after divorce) and the group, demarcation (for example, who can request divorce and why) or vice-versa.

The third principle defended by Shachar is the definition of clearly delineated options. According to this principle, individuals should have clear options between choosing to abide by the state or the group jurisdiction. In particular, this means that individuals can either decide to abide by a jurisdiction or they can refuse to abide by it and exit that jurisdiction at predefined reversal points. These predefined reversal points are an agreement made between the state and the group, where it is decided when individuals can exit the group and in what circumstances.

ii. Negative Universalism

The other approach to the philosophical discussion about justice between groups can be called negative universalism (Festenstein, 2005). Two philosophers who endorse this approach are, according to Festenstein (2005), Barry and Kukathas. Despite the fact that the philosophies of Barry and Kukathas are different, as negative universalists, they have four features in common.

Firstly, both defend the neutrality of the state among different conceptions of the good. That is, individuals should be free to pursue their own conceptions of the good. Secondly, this impartiality does not have the same impact on all citizens’ lives, that is, some will be better-off than others. Nevertheless, this is not, according to these philosophers, a counter-argument against the liberal value of neutrality, because equality of impact is not a realistic goal. Thirdly, principles of liberal theory adopt ‘basic civil and political rights’ with differentiations that may be justified through fundamental basic rights such as freedom of thought and association. However, basic civil and political rights and justified deviations differ substantially when both are permitted simultaneously. Fourth, negative universalists are skeptical concerning the normative value of culture and about providing differentiated rights to individuals (Festenstein, 2005, pp. 91-92).

1. Barry's Liberal Egalitarianism

Barry’s view is that liberal egalitarianism is the philosophical doctrine that offers the most coherent and just approach to protect these interests. In addition, from his viewpoint, liberal egalitarianism offers the normative groundwork for the challenges that illiberal and heterosexist cultural groups raise. His liberal egalitarian approach, in particular, has as core values neutrality, freedom and equality.

According to Barry, neutrality means that states are under the duty of not promoting or favoring some conceptions of the good over others. In general terms, this means that state policy should not promote the survival and flourishing of a conception of the good, a language, a religion and so forth. Rather, neutrality requires that states be committed to individual rights without any sort of collective goal, besides those that correspond to universal basic interests. When the state favors a specific conception of the good by assisting it, it is violating neutrality (Barry, 2001, pp. 28, 29, 122). In Barry’s version of liberal neutrality, conceptions of the good are a private extra-political matter, which refer to personal affairs (Barry, 1995, p. 118). Hence, non-secular states, like Iran or Saudi Arabia, violate neutrality in Barry’s sense because they promote a specific religion.

The other important value for Barry, freedom, means not having paternalistic restrictions on pursuing one’s own conception of the good. This implies that individuals should be provided with a considerable amount of independence to pursue their own conceptions of the good. According to Barry, all individuals should be given the means for this pursuit. In practice, this means that all individuals are entitled to freedoms that enable them to pursue their own conceptions of the good and lifestyles; in particular, Barry considers that freedom of association and conscience play a fundamental role in enabling individuals in this pursuit. Individuals may choose to live a lifestyle that liberals may disapprove of; however, Barry (2001, p. 161) considers that bad choices are something that individuals in a liberal society are entitled to make.

Barry’s third commitment, the one to equality, translates into two core ideas. First, treating people equally means to furnish individuals with an equal set of basic legal, political and civil rights. That is, equality requires endorsing a unitary conception of citizenship. Second, the commitment to equality entails that the state has the duty to promote equality of opportunity. For Barry, there is an equal opportunity when uniform rules generate the same set of choices to all individuals (Barry, 2005). This means that there is equality of opportunity if and only if, in a specific situation, different individuals have the capacity to make the choice that is needed to achieve their aims. For example, imagine that Sam and John want both to be medical doctors; imagine that Sam is from a working class family and John from an upper class family. Sam does not have the economic resources to study, but John has. In such a situation, assuming that the economic factor is the only relevant factor for equalizing choice, in order to achieve equality of opportunity, Sam should be given a similar amount of economic resources to John, so that he has the same capacity to make the choice of a career in medicine. Therefore, equality of opportunity requires that individuals be treated according to their needs. Barry also argues that equality of opportunity entails that the is under the duty of equalizing choice sets, not equalizing the outcomes that result from the decisions people make in those choice sets.

Taking this normative groundwork on board, Barry offers six arguments against giving rights to cultural groups. Four of these are a result of his liberal theory; the other two are independent arguments not related to his theory.

The first argument against difference-sensitive policies for cultural groups presented by Barry is that this would be a violation of neutrality. For Barry, neutrality requires that there is no or little involvement in the cultural character of society; hence, if the state privileged a group either by promoting this group’s culture or by empowering the group with different rights from other groups, then the state would be violating neutrality. Barry believes that liberals are committed to non-interference in the cultural character of society; as a result, liberalism is incompatible with difference-sensitive policies. In practice, what this implies for multicultural demands is that any kind of exemption, recognition, assistance or any other kind of group right should be denied on the grounds of neutrality. For example, in Barry’s view, if a certain state does not criminalize homosexuality and the governing body of a minority religious group asks recognition of its religious courts that convict its gay members for same-sex acts, the state should not concede this recognition because doing so would be giving a different right to a different group and, therefore, it would be a violation of neutrality.

The second argument provided by Barry against group rights is that the unequal impact of policies on cultures is not an interference with freedom to pursue one’s own conception of the good. In Barry’s view, laws have the aim of protecting some interests against others; the fact that they have a different impact on a specific culture is not a sign of unfairness; rather, it is just a side effect of having laws (Barry, 2001, p. 34).

Third, in Barry’s view, the only group rights conceded, especially those exemptions to the law, are cultural practices that overlap with universal human interests. In other words, if the group right and, in particular the exemption to the law, promotes a universal human interest, then it is acceptable (Barry, 2001, pp. 48-50). For instance, Muslim girls cannot be refused education on the grounds of a minor issue such as dress codes, because education is a universal human interest.

Fourth, Barry contends that because neither culture nor cultural demands are a universal interest per se, then the unequal treatment that is acceptable for universal interests does not apply to these (Barry, 2001, pp. 12-13, 16). To recall, Barry’s conception of equality of opportunity entails that individuals can be treated unequally so that their choice sets are equalized. However, Barry affirms that these choice sets should be equalized only if these are choice sets about universal interests, which culture is not. In short, exemptions can and should be guaranteed for universal or higher-order interests but not for particular interests.

These four arguments are dependent on Barry’s liberal theory; they depend on his conception of freedom, neutrality and equality. To these arguments, he adds two ad hoc arguments. First, that difference-sensitive rights that aim to protect economic resources are temporary, while cultural rights are permanent. This means that those who need economic resources to equalize their choice sets only need this aid temporarily (Barry, 2001, pp. 12-13). Contrastingly, according to Barry, group rights to protect culture are required permanently. Like the case of the Sikh, a permanent law that exempted Sikhs from wearing helmets would be necessary. The other ad hoc argument is that when there is a reasonable argument it should be applied without exception. If there is a case for exception, then the rule should be abandoned. According to him, it is philosophically incoherent to provide a universal justification for a rule and then relativize the reason just given (Barry, 2001, pp. 32-50).

2. Kukathas' Libertarianism

Kukathas’ approach to multiculturalism is, broadly speaking, based on two ideas: these ideas are what he considers to be human beings’ most fundamental interest and his theory of freedom of association. Kukathas considers that human beings have only one fundamental interest: the interest in living according to their conscience. In his opinion, the reason for this is, in part, that human beings are primarily moral beings and, consequently, are disposed to direct their lives/purposes towards what they consider to be morally worthwhile. Consequently, from Kukathas’ point of view, individuals find it difficult to act against their conscience. This tendency to govern one’s own conduct primarily by conscience and the difficulty to act against one’s moral beliefs can, in Kukathas’ (2003b, p. 53) view, be observed and has empirical support. An additional reason why acting according to one’s own conscience is a fundamental interest is because, according to Kukathas, the meaning of life is given by conscience (Kukathas, 2003b, p. 55). Hence, Kukathas considers that identity is connected with morality because what individuals are is their self-interpretation, which ultimately is provided by moral evaluation. It is important to notice that this says nothing about what each person’s morality is. A human rights activist and a terrorist can be both acting according to their conscience even if they are doing opposite things. Owing to the fact that conscience is a fundamental interest, Kukathas contends that the state is under the duty to protect this interest.

The second important aspect of Kukathas’ philosophy is his defense of freedom of association. According to Kukathas, freedom of association is primarily defined as the right to exit groups, that is, freedom of association exists when individuals have the freedom to leave or dissociate from a group they are part of. In other words, essential to this version of freedom of association is the idea that individuals should not be forced to remain members of communities they do not wish to associate with. Therefore, according to this definition, freedom of association is not about the freedom of entering a specific group; rather, it is about the freedom to leave those groups that individuals want to dissociate from (Kukathas, 2003b, p. 95).

According to Kukathas, there are two necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for individuals to have the freedom to exit. These conditions are that individuals are not physically barred from leaving, and that there is a place similar to a market society where they can exit. From Kukathas’ point of view, a place to go is a necessary requirement for exit because it would not be credible to think that individuals had a right to exit if all communities were organized on a basis of kinship, for the options available would be either conformity to the rules or loneliness.

According to this theory of freedom, the functions of the state are quite limited. In Kukathas’ style of freedom of association, the state is not duty bound to secure individuals’ access to healthcare, education, and so forth. These forms of welfare should be provided by associations, if those associations wish to provide them. According to Kukathas’ theory, the state should only intervene to guarantee the right to exit, preserving the ongoing order of society by guaranteeing the safety and security of its citizens and preventing civil war. In practice, this means that the state has two functions. First, the state has to guarantee that there is no violation of freedom of association, that is, that individuals within associations are not being forced to remain members by being physically barred from leaving. Second, it means that the state should regulate so that there is no aggression between associations. So, even though associations can endorse practices that are extremely aggressive towards their members, it is a requirement for Kukathas that there is mutual toleration between associations. Societies cannot commit acts of aggression towards each other and, if they do, the state can, in his view, legitimately intervene to stop this aggression.

Bearing in mind the functions of the state and the internal structure of associations, this society would be a society of societies. Each society or group would have its own legislation, that is, they would have jurisdictional independence (Kukathas, 2003b, p. 97). In Kukathas’ view, the validity of the laws of communities only have local recognition, that is, the state would not recognize same-sex marriage and so forth; rather the state would be indifferent to the way individuals associate.

From Kukathas’ point of view, this version of freedom of association is compatible with the imposition of high costs of exit/dissociation and membership due to the fact that the magnitude of costs in a choice are not related to freedom (Kukathas, 2003b, pp. 107-109). In his view, this model of freedom of association is the best way to protect individuals’ freedom of conscience because it gives few restrictions to what individuals can do and consequently allows a wide variety of practices. For instance, an ethnic community where the members, generally speaking, believe that female genital mutilation is an important practice and that it is immoral not to engage in this practice, would be, in Kukathas’ view, better off if they had the possibility to form their own association where the practice would be accepted, then if they were part of a larger community with regulations against such practice.

3. The Second Wave of Writings on Multiculturalism

Taking this on board, in this first wave of writings on multiculturalism, the debate has centered on discussing the justice of difference-sensitive policies in the liberal context. On the whole, there are two difference positions taken by contemporary liberal political philosophers who have written on multiculturalism; some defend that difference-sensitive policies are justified, whereas others argue that they are a deviation from the core values of liberalism.

More recently, a second wave of writings on multiculturalism has appeared. In this, contemporary liberal political philosophers have not focused so much on debates about justice between different groups; rather, they have focused on justice within groups. Thus, the debate has changed to the analysis of the potentially perverse effects of policies to protect minority cultural groups with regard to the members of these minority cultural groups. Contemporary liberal political philosophers have now switched to discussing the practical implications that those that aimed at correcting inter-group equality could have for the members of those groups that the policies are directed to. In particular, the worry is that the policies for enabling members of minority groups to pursue their culture could favor some members of minority groups over others. That is, this new debate is about the risks that those policies for protecting cultural groups could have in undermining the status of the weaker members of these groups. The reason why philosophers worry about this is because the policies for multiculturalism may give the leaders of cultural groups’ power for making decisions and institutionalizing practices that facilitate the persecution of internal minorities. In other words, those policies may give group leaders all kinds of power that reinforce or facilitate cruelty and discrimination within the group (Phillips, 2007a, pp. 13-14; Reich, 2005, pp. 209-210; Shachar, 2001a, pp. 3, 4, 15-16).

Three kinds of internal minorities have received special attention from contemporary political philosophers: these are bisexuals, gays and lesbians, women and children.

a. Gays, Lesbians and Bisexuals

Some philosophers are concerned about how policies meant to protect minority cultural groups can potentially impose serious threats and harm the interests and rights of lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals. In some minority cultural groups, lesbian gay and bisexuals within minorities are very disadvantaged by the unintended consequences of multicultural politics (Levy, 2005; Swaine, 2005, pp. 44-45). Heterosexism is a cross-cutting issue in minority cultural groups (and society in general), covering diverse areas of life, ranging from basic freedoms and rights, employment, education, family life, economic and welfare rights, sexual freedom, physical and psychological integrity, safety, and so forth. In general terms, it can be affirmed that lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals have an interest in bodily and psychological integrity, sexual freedom, participation in cultural and political life, family life, basic civil and political rights, economic and employment equality and access to welfare provision.

Sometimes, lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals have their freedom of association, opinion, expression, assembly, and thought limited (European Union Agency for Fundamental Rights, 2009, pp. 50-55). Minority cultural groups can jeopardize these interests due to hierarchies of power within groups. Some groups use a variety of norms of social control. Also in some groups, participation in political decisions and freedom of expression is culturally determined.

In some minority cultural groups, lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals’ interest in being free from murder, torture, and other cruel, inhuman and degrading treatment is also sometimes violated (European Union Agency for Fundamental Rights, 2009, pp. 13-16). Many lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals are victims of physical and psychological harassment, murder, hate speech, hate crimes, brutal sexual conversion therapies, and corrective rape, among other kinds of physical and psychological violence.

Some minority cultural groups also sometimes undermine lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals’ interests in economic and welfare rights. In the case of employment, this refers to anti-discrimination law in the workplace and in admission for jobs. In some cases, lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals’ freedom and the right to join the armed forces, to work with children, to employment benefits and health insurance for same-sex families are denied. Although not many religious groups have armed forces, this example could apply to the Swiss Army that protects the Vatican.

Bearing this in mind, some contemporary political philosophers have discussed to what extent giving special rights to groups can potentially facilitate the imposition of such unequal and cruel practices.

b. Women

Some philosophers, especially liberal feminist philosophers, have raised concerns about the implications of providing special rights to groups for women. Okin has contended that most cultures in the world are patriarchal and gendered and, consequently, providing rights to groups may help with reinforcing oppressive gendered and patriarchal practices. Some of the practices that may jeopardize women’s rights are female genital mutilation, polygamy, the use of headscarves, and a lesser valuation of the career and education of women.

Female genital mutilation, a practice that some communities engage in, is considered by some feminists to be a cruel practice that undermines the sexual health of women and aims at controlling their bodies. Polygamy is a practice that some communities follow, with some feminists contending that this practice is deeply disrespectful to women, and a clear way of treating women unequally. The use of headscarves is considered by some feminists to be a way of controlling women’s bodies and showing submission to males. Taking this on board, the concern expressed by some feminists is that empowering groups with special rights may reinforce female oppression. For example, if some communities are exempt from the health practices of the majority of society, this may help them to perpetuate and spread the practice of female genital mutilation.

Nevertheless, it is important to emphasize that the view that cultures are necessarily patriarchal, gendered and oppressive for women is not a unanimous position among feminists. Indeed, Volpp (2001) and Phillips (2007a), for instance, have defended the position that many feminists take an ethnocentric point of view when analyzing minority practices and misunderstand the true meaning of practices. Furthermore, Volpp and Phillips contend that many women in minority cultures are agents capable of making their own choices; therefore some of those practices that can be considered oppressive from a Western point of view should not be banned.

c. Children

The implications of special rights to children who are members of minority cultures is also a topic that has received some attention from contemporary political philosophers (Reich, 2005). The concerns with respect to children are especially with regards to physical and psychological abuse and lack of education. With respect to physical and psychological abuse, some groups may have practices that are harmful for children. For example, some groups practice shunning, a practice that consists of ostracizing those who do not follow their norms or who have done something that is disapproved of by the community. The traditional scarification of children that some African communities practice is also a practice that may be considered to entail physical abuse. With respect to education, there are groups who wish to take their children out of school at an earlier age. Some may argue that removing children from school earlier than their peers may strongly disadvantage these children because they will potentially not acquire the minimum skills necessary to find a job, and will not receive enough education to make autonomous choices. Other groups consider that education should be mainly about the study of the religious scripture, and they sometimes disregard other kinds of education.

Owing to the fact that schools are a central vehicle of autonomy and cultural transmission and because children are at a formative age and, thereby, much more likely to be influenced by the way they are brought up, some political philosophers have shown concern about the impact of giving special rights to groups that may treat children inappropriately, indoctrinate them, and maybe disadvantage them when compared with children who are not members of those groups.

It is important to emphasize, however, that this is not to say that providing special rights to minority groups entails that children, women and gays, lesbians and bisexuals will be disadvantaged. Many postcolonial philosophers, like Mookherjee (2005), have contended that even though there may be worries about internal oppression, sometimes these worries are misplaced. Routinely, members of minority cultures see value in their cultural practices and wish to endorse them, despite the fact that these practices may look oppressive for outsiders. Furthermore, sometimes practices may seem illiberal to an outsider, but because their social meaning differs from the one given by the outsider, the practice is not illiberal (Horton, 2003).

4. Animals and Multiculturalism

Another topic that has not been explored very much is how multicultural policies can have perverse effects on non-human sentient animals. If a thin conception of non-human sentient animals’ interests is endorsed, it can be understood how animals’ interests may be violated by multicultural policies. Assume that animals have three kinds of interests. First, they have the interest in not having gross suffering inflicted upon them (Casal, 2003; Cochrane, 2007). Second, non-human sentient animals have an interest in some degree of negative freedom: they have an interest in not being physically restricted in cages or forced to undertake hard labor. Third, non-human sentient animals have an interest in having access to resources for their well-being; in particular, non-human sentient animals have an interest in receiving veterinary care and in not being malnourished or denied food. With this modest assumption that animals have an interest in not being treated with cruelty and instead wish to pursue a healthy life, some philosophers have contended that animals’ interests are at risk when giving special rights to groups. There are cultural groups which have practices that interfere with the interests of non-human sentient animals and in terms of multiculturalism these policies may give cultural groups powers that may facilitate animal cruelty. Some cultural groups engage in particular animal slaughtering practices because their religion imposes that meat is cut in a specific way before it is eaten. An example of how multicultural policies can be damaging for non-human sentient animals is if the exemption of minority groups from state laws on animal cruelty could lead to the facilitation of inflicting these harmful practices on animals. In particular, if those groups who practice certain types of animal slaughtering are exempt from animal cruelty laws, then this may facilitate the violation of animals’ interests in not having gross suffering inflicted upon them.

This topic raises also a problem of legitimacy. Most majority societies fail to treat animals with respect and do not usually protect the interests of non-human sentient animals. As a result, a philosophical question that may arise is whether intervention in the practices of minorities mistreat non-human sentient animals would be legitimate, given the fact that majorities themselves fail to treat animals with respect.

5. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

Luís Cordeiro Rodrigues
University of York
United Kingdom

Latin American Philosophy

This article outlines the history of Latin American philosophy: the thinking of its indigenous peoples, the debates over conquest and colonization, the arguments for national independence in the eighteenth century, the challenges of nation-building and modernization in the nineteenth century, the concerns over various forms of development in the twentieth century, and the diverse interests in Latin American philosophy during the opening decades of the twenty-first century. Rather than attempt to provide an exhaustive and impossibly long list of scholars’ names and dates, this article outlines the history of Latin American philosophy while trying to provide a meaningful sense of detail by focusing briefly on individual thinkers whose work points to broader philosophical trends that are inevitably more complex and diverse than any encyclopedic treatment can hope to capture.

The term “Latin American philosophy” refers broadly to philosophy in, from, or about Latin America. However, the definitions of both “Latin America” and “philosophy” are historically fluid and contested, leading to even more disagreement when combined. “Latin America” typically refers to the geographic areas on the American continent where languages derived from Latin are widely spoken: Portuguese in Brazil, and Spanish in most of Central America, South America, and parts of the Caribbean. The French-speaking parts of the Caribbean are sometimes included as well, but all mainland North American regions north of the Rio Grande are excluded in spite of French being widely spoken in Canada. Although it is anachronistic to speak of Latin American philosophy before the 1850s when the term “Latin America” first entered usage, most scholars agree that Latin American philosophy extends at least as far back as the sixteenth century when the Spanish founded the first schools and seminaries in the “New World”. Given this widespread agreement that there was “Latin American philosophy” before anyone was using the term “Latin America,” many scholars have argued for including pre-Columbian and pre-Cabralian thought in the history of Latin American philosophy. A number of indigenous cultures (particularly the Aztecs, Mayas, Incas, and Tupi-Guarani) produced sophisticated systems of thought long before Europeans arrived with their own understanding of “philosophy.”

The scholarly debate over whether or not to include indigenous thought in the history of Latin American philosophy reveals that the question of what constitutes Latin American philosophy hinges upon both our understanding of what constitutes Latin America and our understanding of what constitutes philosophy. It is worthwhile to remember that these and other labels are the products of human activity and dispute, not the result of a pre-ordained teleological process. Just as “America” was not called “America” by its indigenous inhabitants, the term “Latin America” emerged in the nineteenth century from outside of the region in French intellectual circles. The term competed against terms like “Ibero-America” until “Latin America” gained widespread and largely unquestioned usage in public and academic discourse in the second half of the twentieth century. More than a debate over mere terms, Latin American philosophy demonstrates a longstanding preoccupation with the identity of Latin America itself and a lively debate over the authenticity of its philosophy. Given the history of colonialism in the region, much of the history of Latin American philosophy analyzes ethical and sociopolitical issues, frequently treating concrete problems of practical concern like education or political revolution.

Table of Contents

  1. Indigenous Period
  2. Colonial Period
    1. Scholasticism and Debates on Conquest
    2. Post-conquest Indigenous Thought
    3. Proto-nationalism
    4. Proto-feminism
    5. Enlightenment Philosophy
  3. Nineteenth Century
    1. Political Independence
    2. Mental and Cultural Emancipation
    3. Positivism
  4. Twentieth Century
    1. Generation of 1900: Foundational Critique of Positivism
    2. Generation of 1915: New Philosophical Directions
    3. Generation of 1930: Forging Latin American Philosophy
    4. Generation of 1940: Normalization of Latin American Philosophy
    5. Generation of 1960: Philosophies of Liberation
    6. Generation of 1980: Globalization, Postmodernism, and Postcolonialism
  5. Twenty-First Century
    1. Plurality of Philosophies in Latin America
    2. Normalization of Latin American Philosophy in the United States
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Indigenous Period

Most histories of Western philosophy claim that philosophy began in ancient Greece with Thales of Miletus (c.624–c.546 B.C.E.) and other pre-Socratics who engaged in sophisticated speculation about the origins of the universe and its workings. There is ample evidence that a number of indigenous peoples in present-day Latin America also engaged in this sort of sophisticated speculation well before the 1500s when Europeans arrived to ask the question of whether it was philosophy. Moreover, a few Europeans during the early colonial period, including the Franciscan priest Bernardino de Sahagún (1499-1590), reported the existence of philosophy and philosophers among the indigenous Aztecs of colonial New Spain. In any case, whether or not most sixteenth-century European explorers, conquistadores, and missionaries believed that there were indigenous philosophies and philosophers, indigenous cultures produced sophisticated systems of thought centuries before Europeans arrived.

The largest and most notable of these indigenous civilizations are: the Aztec (in present-day central Mexico), the Maya (in present-day southern Mexico and northern Central America), and the Inca (in present-day western South America centered in Peru). Considerable challenges face scholars attempting to understand their complex systems of thought, since almost all of their texts and the other artifacts that would have testified most clearly concerning their intellectual production were systematically burned or otherwise destroyed by European missionaries who considered them idolatrous. Nevertheless, scholars have used the handful of pre-colonial codices and other available sources to reconstruct plausible interpretations of these philosophies, while remaining cognizant of the dangers inherent in using Western philosophical concepts to understand non-Western thought. See the article on Aztec Philosophy for an excellent example.

2. Colonial Period

Academic philosophy during the colonial period was dominated by scholasticism imported from the Iberian Peninsula. With the support of Charles V—the first king of Spain and Holy Roman Emperor from 1516 to 1556—schools, monasteries, convents, and seminaries were established across the Indies (as the American continent and Caribbean were known then). Mexico was the main philosophical center in the early colonial period, with Peru gaining importance in the seventeenth century. The adherents of various religious orders who taught at these centers of higher learning emphasized the texts of medieval scholastics like Thomas Aquinas and Duns Scotus, as well as their Iberian commentators, particularly those associated with the School of Salamanca, for example, Francisco de Vitoria (c.1483-1546), Domingo de Soto (1494-1560), and Francisco Suárez (1548-1617). The thoroughly medieval style and sources of their theological and philosophical disputations concerning the Indies and its peoples contrast starkly with the extraordinarily new epistemological, ethical, religious, legal, and political questions that arose over time alongside attempts to colonize and missionize the New World. Much of the philosophy developed in the Indies appeared in isolation from its social and political context. For example, there was nothing uniquely Mexican about Antonio Rubio’s (1548-1615) Logica mexicana (1605). This careful analysis of Aristotelian logic in light of recent scholastic developments brought fame to the University of Mexico when it was adopted as logic textbook back in Europe where it went through seven editions.

a. Scholasticism and Debates on Conquest

One of the most famous philosophical debates of the early colonial period concerned the supposed rights of the Spanish monarchy over the indigenous peoples of the Indies. Bartolomé de las Casas (1484-1566) debated Ginés de Sepúlveda (1490-1573) at the Council of Valladolid (1550-1551). Sepúlveda, who had never traveled to America, defended the Spanish conquest as an instance of just war, outlined the rights of the colonizers to seize native lands and possessions, and claimed that it was morally just to enslave the Indians, arguing on the basis of Thomism, Scripture, and Aristotelian philosophy. Las Casas countered Sepúlveda’s arguments by drawing upon the same theological and philosophical sources as well as decades of his own experiences living in different parts of the Indies. Las Casas argued that the war against the Indians was unjust, that neither Spain nor the Church had jurisdiction over Indians who had not accepted Christ, and that Aristotle’s category of “natural slaves” did not apply to the Indians. No formal winner of the debate was declared, but it did lead to las Casas’ most influential work, In Defense of the Indians, written from 1548-1550.

b. Post-conquest Indigenous Thought

Indigenous perspectives on some of these philosophical issues emerge in post-conquest texts that also depict pre-colonial life and history in light of more recent colonial violence. The work of Felipe Guamán Poma de Ayala (c.1550-1616), a native Andean intellectual and artist, serves as an excellent example. Written around 1615 and addressed to King Philip III of Spain, Guamán Poma’s The First New Chronicle and Good Government consists of nearly 800 pages of text in Spanish accompanied by many Quechua phrases and nearly 400 line drawings. Guamán Poma skillfully combines local histories, Spanish chronicles of conquest, Catholic moral and philosophical discourses (including those of Bartolomé de las Casas), various eyewitness accounts (including his own), and oral reports in multiple indigenous languages, to build a powerful case for maximum Indian autonomy given the ongoing history of abuse by Spanish conquerors, priests, and government officials. This and other post-conquest native texts affirm the ongoing existence of native intellectual traditions, contest the colonial European understanding of indigenous peoples as barbarians, and challenge Eurocentric views of American geography and history.

c. Proto-nationalism

As part of European conquest and colonization a new social hierarchy or caste system based on race was developed. White Spanish colonists born on the Iberian Peninsula (peninsulares) held the highest position, followed by white Spaniards born in the Indies (criollos), both of whom were far above Indians (indios) and Africans (negros) in the hierarchy. First generation individuals born to parents of different races were called mestizos (Indian and white), mulatos (African and white), and sambos (Indian and African). The subsequent mixing of already mixed generations further complicated the hierarchy and led to a remarkably complex racial terminology. In any case, higher education was almost always restricted to whites, who typically had to demonstrate the purity of their racial origins in order to enroll. By the seventeenth century, well-educated criollos were developing new perspectives on the Indies and their colonial experience. Anxious to maintain their status through intellectual ties to the Iberian Peninsula while nevertheless establishing their own place and tradition in America, these thinkers reflected on diverse topics while developing a proto-nationalist discourse that would eventually lead to independence. The work of Carlos de Sigüenza y Góngora (1645-1700) provides an interesting case of criollo ambivalence with respect to American identity. On the one hand, Sigüenza idealized Aztec society and was one of the first criollos to appropriate their past in order to articulate the uniqueness of American identity. On the other hand, this did not prevent Sigüenza from despising contemporary Indians, especially when they rioted in the streets during a food shortage in Mexico City.

d. Proto-feminism

Similar to the way in which scholars have retrospectively perceived a budding nationalism in intellectuals like Sigüenza, Sor Juana Inés de la Cruz (1651-1695) is widely regarded as a forerunner of feminist philosophy in Latin America. Just as non-whites were typically barred from higher education based on European assumptions of racial inferiority, women were not permitted access to formal education on the assumption of sexual inferiority. Basic education was provided in female convents, but their reading and writing still occurred under the supervision of male church officials and confessors. After establishing a positive reputation for knowledge across literature, history, music, languages, and natural science, Sor Juana was publicly reprimanded for entering the male-dominated world of theological debate. Under the penname of Sor Philothea de la Cruz (Sister Godlover of the Cross), the Bishop of Puebla told Sor Juana to abandon intellectual pursuits that were improper for a woman. Sor Juana’s extensive answer to Sor Philothea subtly but masterfully defends rational equality between men and women, makes a powerful case for women’s right to education, and develops an understanding of wisdom as a form of self-realization.

e. Enlightenment Philosophy

Although leading Latin American intellectuals in the eighteenth century did not completely abandon scholasticism, they began to draw upon new sources in order to think through new social and political questions. Interest grew in early modern European philosophy and the Enlightenment, especially as this “new philosophy” entered the curriculum of schools and universities. The experimental and scientific methods gained ground over the syllogism, just as appeals to scriptural or Church authority were slowly replaced by appeals to experience and reason. The rational liberation from intellectual authority that characterized the Enlightenment also fueled desires for individual liberty and national autonomy, which became defining issues in the century that followed.

3. Nineteenth Century

a. Political Independence

In the early nineteenth century, national independence movements swept through Latin America. However, some scholars have categorized these wars for independence as civil wars, since the majority of combatants on both sides were Latin Americans. Criollos, although a numerical minority (roughly 15% of the Latin American population in the early nineteenth century), led the push for political independence and clearly gained the most from it. In contrast, most of the combatants were mestizos (roughly 25% of the population) and indios (roughly 45% of the population) whose positions in society after national independence were scarcely improved and sometimes even made worse.

Scholars disagree about whether to understand changes in Latin American thought as causes or as effects of these political independence movements. In any case, Simon Bolívar (1783-1830) is generally considered to be their most prominent leader. Not only was “The Liberator” a military man and political founder of new nations, he was also an intellectual who developed a clear and prescient understanding of the challenges that lay ahead for Latin America not just in his own time but well into the future. Bolívar gained his philosophical, historical, and geographical perspective from both book-learning and extensive travels throughout much of Europe and the United States. Frequently citing the French Enlightenment philosopher Montesquieu (1689-1755) in his political writings, Bolívar believed that good laws and institutions were not the sorts of things that should simply be copied. Rather they must be carefully adapted to particular historical, geographical, and cultural realities. In this light, Bolívar perceived that the immediate costs of Latin American independence included anarchy, chaos, and a general lack of both personal and political virtue. He thus sought to create strong but subtle forms of centralized power capable of balancing new political freedoms. At the same time he sought to establish an educational system capable of developing an autonomous, independent national consciousness from a heteronomous and dependent colonial consciousness that had never been permitted to practice the art of government. Bolívar’s passionate calls for freedom and equality for all Latin Americans, including the emancipation of slaves, were thus consistently coupled with reasons that justified the concentration of authority in a small, well-educated group of mostly criollo elite. The result was that colonial socioeconomic structures remained firmly intact even after independence, leaving a gap between the ideals of liberty and the practical reality experienced by most people.

b. Mental and Cultural Emancipation

By the middle of the nineteenth century, most Latin American countries were no longer colonies, although a few did not achieve independence until considerably later (for example, Cuba in 1898). Nevertheless, there was a widespread sense even among political and intellectual elites that complete independence had not been achieved. Many thinkers framed the problem in terms of a distinction been the political independence that had already been achieved and the mental or cultural emancipation that remained as the task for a new generation. By developing their own diagnosis of the lingering colonial mindset, this generation sought to give birth to a new American culture, literature, and philosophy. Some of the most important were: Andrés Bello (1781-1865) in Venezuela,  Francisco Bilbao (1823-1865) and José Victorino Lastarria (1817-1888) in Chile, Juan Bautista Alberdi (1810-1884) and Domingo Faustino Sarmiento (1811-1888) in Argentina, Gabino Barreda (1818-1881) in Mexico, Juan Montalvo (1833-1889) in Ecuador, Manuel González Prada (1844-1918) in Peru, and Luis Pereira Barreto (1840-1923) in Brazil. Among these thinkers, Juan Bautista Alberdi was the first to explicitly address the question of the character and future of Latin American philosophy, which he believed to be intimately linked with the character and future of the Latin American people. (It is worth reiterating the fact that the term “Latin America” still did not exist and that Alberdi spoke about the future of “American philosophy” as a reflection of the “American people” without meaning to include the philosophy or people of the United States). For Alberdi, Latin American philosophy should be used an intellectual tool for developing an understanding of the most vital social, political, religious, and economic problems facing the people of Latin America. (It is worth nothing that Alberdi’s references to “the people” of Latin America were aimed primarily at his fellow criollos, implicitly excluding the non-white majority of the population). Alberdi’s Foundations and Points of Departure for the Political Organization of the Republic of Argentina served as one of the major foundations for Argentina’s 1853 Constitution, which with amendments remains in force to this day.

c. Positivism

Almost all of the thinkers from the generation that sought intellectual and cultural emancipation from the colonial past came to identify with the philosophy of positivism, which dominated much of the intellectual landscape of Latin America throughout the second half of the nineteenth century. Strictly speaking, positivism originated in Europe with the French philosopher Auguste Comte (1798-1859), but it was warmly welcomed by many Latin American intellectuals who saw Comte’s motto of “order and progress” as a European version of what they had been struggling for themselves. While adapting positivism to their own regional conditions, they presented it optimistically as a philosophy based upon an experimental and scientific method that could modernize both the economy and the educational system in order to produce social and political stability. The influence of positivism on Latin America is perhaps most vividly portrayed in Brazil’s current flag, adopted in 1889, which features the words Ordem e Progresso (Order and Progress). However, the literal adoption of Comte’s motto masks the fact that the meaning of positivism in Latin America underwent considerable change under the influence of the English philosopher Herbert Spencer (1820-1903) and others who both sought to reformulate positivism in light of Darwinian evolutionary theory. This later variety of evolutionary positivism was also frequently called materialism, characterized by its rejection of dualist and idealist metaphysics, its mechanistic philosophy of history, its promotion of intense industrial competition as the primary means of material progress, and its frequent explanation of various social and political problems in biological terms of racial characteristics. While the precise understanding of positivism differed from thinker to thinker and the scope of positivism’s influence varied from country to country, there is little question of its overall importance.

The history of positivism in Mexico can be used to illustrate the shifting meaning of positivism in a particular national context. Gabino Barreda (1818-1881) founded the National Preparatory School in Mexico City in 1868 and made a modified form of Comte’s positivism the basis of its curriculum. Barreda understood Mexico’s social disorder to be a direct reflection of intellectual disorder, which he sought to reorganize in its entirety under the authority of President Benito Juárez. Like Comte, Barreda wanted to place all education in the service of moral, social, and economic progress. Unlike Comte, Barreda interpreted political liberalism as an expression of the positive spirit, modifying Comte’s famous motto to read: “Liberty as the means; order as the base; progress as the end.” The philosophical positions held by the second generation of Mexican positivists were quite different, even though they all hailed Barreda as their teacher. Eventually, many of them joined the científicos, a circle of technocratic advisors to the dictator Porfirio Díaz. The most famous among them, Justo Sierra (1848-1912), developed his philosophy of Mexican history using Spencer’s theory of evolution in an attempt to accelerate the evolution of Mexico through a kind of social engineering. Although Sierra initially judged Porfirio Díaz’s dictatorship to be necessary in order to secure the order necessary to make progress possible, in the final years of his life Sierra cast doubt upon both positivism and the dictatorship it had been used to support.

One of the earliest critics of positivism in Latin America was the Cuban philosopher Jose Martí (1853-1895). His criticism was linked to a different vision of what he called Nuestra América (Our America”), reclaiming the word “America” from the way it is commonly used to refer exclusively to the United States of America. Whereas positivists or materialists tended to explain the evolutionary backwardness of Latin America in terms of the biological backwardness of the races that constituted the majority of its population, Martí pointed to the ongoing international history of political and economic policies that systematically disadvantaged these same people. Like Juan Bautista Alberdi had done a generation before, Martí called for Latin American intellectuals to develop their own understanding of the most vital social, political, religious, and economic problems facing the Latin American people. Unlike Alberdi, Martí took a more positive and inclusive view of Latin American identity by giving indios, mestizos, negros, and mulatos a place alongside criollos in the task of building a truly free Latin America. According to Marti, the ongoing failure of the United States to grant equality to Native Americans and former slaves in the construction of its America was just as dangerous to imitate as the European political model. Unfortunately, Martí died young in the Cuban war to gain political independence from Spain, but as an idealist he believed that powerful ideas like liberty must play an equal role in freeing Latin America from the imperialistic impulses of both Europe and the United States.

4. Twentieth Century

A backlash against the intellectual hegemony of positivism marks the beginning of the twentieth century in Latin America. The “scientific” nature of positivism was charged with being “scientistic;” materialism was challenged by new forms of idealism and vitalism; and evolutionism was criticized by various social and political philosophies that supported revolution. As the century wore on, there was a dramatic proliferation of philosophical currents so that speaking of Latin American philosophy as a whole becomes increasingly difficult. Ironically, this difficulty arises during the very same period that the term “Latin America” first began to achieve widespread use in public and academic discourse, and the period that the first historical treatments of Latin American philosophy appeared. In response to the problems inherent in speaking of Latin American philosophy as a whole, scholars have narrowed their scope by writing about the history of twentieth century philosophy in a particular Latin American country (especially Mexico, Argentina, or Brazil); in a particular region (for example, Central America or the Caribbean); in a particular philosophical tradition (for example, Marxism, phenomenology, existentialism, neo-scholasticism, historicism, philosophy of liberation, analytic philosophy, or feminist philosophy); or in and through a list of important figures. Alternatively, attempts to provide a more panoramic vision of Latin American philosophy in the twentieth century typically proceed by delineating somewhere between three and six generations or periods. For the sake of continuity in scope and detail, the present article utilizes this method and follows a six-generation schema that assigns a rough year to each generation based upon when they were writing rather than when they were born (modeled upon Beorlegui 2006).

a. Generation of 1900: Foundational Critique of Positivism

The members of the first twentieth-century generational group of 1900 are often called “the generation of founders” or “the generation of patriarchs,” following the influential terminology of Francisco Romero or Francisco Miró Quesada, respectively. Members of this generation include José Enrique Rodó (1871-1917) and Carlos Vaz Ferreira (1872-1958) in Uruguay, Alejandro Korn (1860-1936) in Argentina; Alejandro Deústua (1849-1945) in Peru; Raimundo de Farias Brito (1862-1917) in Brazil; Enrique José Varona (1849-1933) in Cuba; and Enrique Molina Garmendia (1871-1964) in Chile. The year of 1900 conveniently refers to the change of century and marks the publication of Rodó’s Ariel, which exerted tremendous influence on other Latin American intellectuals. Like those that had come before them, Rodó and the other members of this generation did not write primarily for other philosophers but rather for a broader public in an attempt to influence the courses of their countries. Like Jose Martí, Rodó criticized a particular form of positivism or materialism, which he associated with the United States or Anglo-Saxon America and presented in the barbaric character of “Caliban” from Shakespeare’s The Tempest. In contrast, Rodó presents the civilized “Ariel” as the Latin American spirit of idealism that values art, sentiment, philosophy, and critical thinking. Rodó thus recommends a return to the classical values of ancient Greece and the best of contemporary European (especially French) philosophy. This recommendation is presented in contrast to what Rodó calls nordomanía or the manic delatinization of America, that is, the growing but unthinking imitation of the United States, its plutocracy, and its reductively material and individualist understandings of success.

b. Generation of 1915: New Philosophical Directions

The members of the generation of 1915 are often grouped with the previous generation of “founders” or “patriarchs” but they are presented here separately because they represent a growing interest in the mestizo or indigenous dimensions of Latin American identity. As it had since colonial times, Latin American philosophy in the twentieth century continued to connect many of its philosophical and political problems to the identity of its peoples. But in light of events like the Mexican revolution that began in 1910, some thinkers began to rebel against the historical tendency to view mestizos and indigenous peoples as negative elements to be overcome through ongoing assimilation and European immigration. Principal members of this generation include Antonio Caso (1883-1946), José Vasconcelos (1882-1959), and Alfonso Reyes (1889-1959) in Mexico; Pedro Henríquez Ureña (1884-1946) in Dominican Republic; Cariolano Alberini (1886-1960) in Argentina; Víctor Raúl Haya de la Torre (1895-1979) and José Carlos Mariátegui (1894-1930) in Peru. The first four thinkers just listed were members of the famous Atheneum of Youth, an intellectual and artistic group founded in 1909 that is crucial for understanding Mexican culture in the twentieth century. Drawing upon Rodó’s Ariel—as well as other American and European philosophers including Henri Bergson (1859–1941), Friedrich Nietzsche (1844-1900), and William James (1842-1910)—the Atheneum developed a sweeping criticism of the reigning positivism of the científicos and began to take Latin American philosophy in new directions. The members of the Atheneum also explicitly linked their intellectual revolution to Mexico’s social revolution, thereby recapitulating the nineteenth century concern to achieve both political independence and mental emancipation. Jose Vasconcelos’ most famous work, The Cosmic Race (1925), presents a vision of Mexico and Latin America more generally as the birthplace of a new mixed race whose mission would be to usher in a new age by ethnically and spiritually fusing all of the existing races. Vasconcelos subsumed the 1910 Mexican Revolution in a larger world-historical vision of the New World in which Mexicans and other Latin American peoples would redeem humanity from its long history of violence, achieve political stability, and undertake the integral spiritual development of humankind (replacing prevailing notions of human progress as merely materialistic or technological).

Focusing on Indians rather than mestizos, José Carlos Mariátegui offered a vision of Peru and Indo-America (his preferred term for Latin America) that would reverse the disastrous social and economic effects of the conquest. One of the most important Marxist thinkers in the history of Latin America, Mariátegui tied the future of Peru to the socialist liberation of its indigenous peasants, who made up the vast majority of the country’s population and whose lives were only made worse by national independence. Unlike orthodox scientific Marxists, Mariátegui believed that aesthetics and spirituality had a key role to play in fueling the revolution by uniting various marginalized peoples in the belief that they could create a new, more egalitarian society. Furthermore, Mariátegui grounded his analysis in the historical and cultural conditions of the Andean region, which had developed indigenous forms of agrarian communism destroyed by the Spanish colonizers. Seven Interpretive Essays on Peruvian Reality, published in 1928, highlights the Indian character of Peru and offers a structural interpretation of the ongoing exploitation of indigenous peoples as rooted in the usurpation of their communal lands. Mariátegui argued that administrative, educational, and humanitarian approaches to overcoming the suffering of Indians will necessarily fail unless they overcome the local racialized class system that operates in the larger context of global capitalism.

c. Generation of 1930: Forging Latin American Philosophy

The members of the third twentieth-century generational group of 1930 are often called the “forgers” or the “shapers” (depending upon the translation of Miró Quesada’s influential term forjadores). Members include Samuel Ramos (1897-1959) and José Gaos (1900-1969) in Mexico; Francisco Romero (1891-1962) and Carlos Astrada (1894-1970) in Argentina; and Juan David García Bacca (1901-1992) in Venezuela. After the first two generations of “founders” or “patriarchs” had criticized positivism in order to develop their own personal versions of the philosophic enterprise, the forjadores developed the philosophical foundations and institutions that they took to be necessary for bringing their authentically Latin American philosophical projects to the far better-recognized level of European philosophy. Mariátegui can be understood as a precursor in this respect, since his philosophical influences were primarily European, but his philosophy was rooted in a distinctively Peruvian reality. In their quest to philosophize from a distinctively Latin American perspective, many of the forjadores were greatly influenced by the “perspectivism” of the Spanish philosopher José Ortega y Gasset (1883-1955). Ortega’s impact on Latin American philosophy only increased—particularly in Mexico, Argentina, and Venezuela—with the arrival of Spaniards exiled during the Spanish Civil War (1936-1939). José Gaos was undoubtedly the most influential of these transterrados (transplants), who helped found new educational institutions, publish new academic journals, establish new publishing houses, and translate hundreds of works in Ancient and European philosophy.

The long philosophical career of Juan David García Bacca illustrates the shifting philosophical currents and geographic displacements that forged new developments in Latin American philosophy. Author of over five hundred philosophical works and translations, García Bacca received his philosophical training in Spain, largely under the influence of neo-scholasticism until Ortega woke him from his dogmatic slumber. García Bacca spent the first years of his exile (1938-1941) in Quito, Ecuador, where he began to deconstruct the Aristotelian or Thomistic conception of human nature and replace it with an understanding of man as historical, technological, and transfinite. In other words, García Bacca presented human beings as finite creatures who are nevertheless godlike in their infinite capacity to recreate themselves. In 1941, García Bacca accepted an invitation from the National Autonomous University of Mexico (UNAM) to teach a course on the philosophy of the influential German existentialist and phenomenologist Martin Heidegger (1889-1976). In 1946, García Bacca along with other transterrados founded the Department of Philosophy at the Central University of Venezuela, where he continued to work out his philosophy in dialogue with the traditions of historicism, vitalism, phenomenology, hermeneutics, and existentialism. Following a broad intellectual trend in Latin America after the Cuban revolution of 1959, his understanding of the Latin American context was transformed under the influence of Marxism beginning in the 1960s. García Bacca gave his understanding of human nature as transfinite a substantially new twist by requiring nothing less than the transformation of human nature under socialism. Once again indicating broad intellectual trends in the 1980s, García Bacca began distancing himself somewhat from Marxism and contributed greatly to the history of philosophy in Latin America by publishing substantial anthologies of philosophical thought in Venezuela and Colombia. 

d. Generation of 1940: Normalization of Latin American Philosophy

Given the tremendous progress in the institutionalization of Latin American philosophy from roughly 1940 until 1960, this period is frequently referred to as that of “normalization” (again following the influential periodization of Francisco Romero). The generation that benefited was the first to consistently receive formal academic training in philosophy in order to become professors in an established system of universities. These philosophers developed an increasing consciousness of Latin American philosophical identity, aided in part by increased travel and dialogue between Latin American countries and universities (some of it forced under politically oppressive conditions that led to exile). Members of this fourth generation include Risieri Frondizi (1910-1985) and Augusto Salazar Bondy (1925-1974) in Argentina; Miguel Reale (1910-2006) in Brazil; Francisco Miró Quesada (1918- ) in Peru; Arturo Ardao (1912-2003) in Uruguay; and Leopoldo Zea (1912-2004) and Luis Villoro (1922- ) in Mexico. Building upon the philosophies of their teachers, as well as the philosophical conception of hispanidad that many inherited from the Spanish philosophers Miguel de Unamuno (1864-1936) and Ortega y Gasset, this generation developed a critical philosophical perspective that is often called “Latin Americanism.” The philosophy of Leopold Zea is widely taken to be exemplary of this approach. Under the influence of Samuel Ramos and the direction of Jose Gaós at the UNAM, Zea defended his 1944 dissertation on the rise and fall of positivism in Mexico, later translated as Positivism in Mexico (1974). In 1949, Zea founded the famous Hyperion Group of philosophers seeking to shed light upon Mexican identity and reality. Convinced that the past must be known and understood in order to construct an authentic future, Zea went on to situate his work in a panoramic philosophical view of Latin American history, drawing upon the earlier works of Bolívar, Alberdi, Martí, and many others. Zea’s extensive travels and ongoing professional dialogue with other Latin American philosophers across the Continent resulted in many works, including one translated as The Latin American Mind (1963). He also edited a series of works by other scholars on the history of ideas across Latin America, published by El Fondo de Cultura Económica, Mexico’s largest publishing house. Anticipating themes that marked future generations of Latin American philosophy, Zea’s later works such as Latin America and the World (1969) thematized the concepts of marginalization and liberation while situating Latin American philosophy in a global context. In short, Zea consistently sought to develop a Latin American philosophy that would be capable of grasping Latin America’s concrete history and present circumstances in an authentic, responsible, and ultimately universal way.

Zea’s quest for an authentic Latin American philosophy emerged as part of a larger debate over the nature of Latin American philosophy and whether it was something more than an imitation of European philosophy. An examination of one of Zea’s most famous opponents in this debate—Augusto Salazar Bondy—will help set the stage for the subsequent discussion of the philosophies of liberation that emerged in the 1970s with the next philosophical generation. Bondy lays out his position in his book, ¿Existe una filosofía de nuestra América? (1968) [Does a Philosophy of Our America Exist?]. Bondy attacks what he takes to be Zea’s ungrounded idealism and maintains that the existence of an authentic Latin American philosophy is inseparable from the concrete socioeconomic conditions of Latin America, which place it in a situation of dependence and economic underdevelopment in relation to Europe and the United States. This in turn produces a “defective culture” in which inauthentic intellectual works are mistaken for authentic philosophical productions. The problem is not that Latin American philosophy fails to be rooted in concrete reality (a problem that Zea works painstakingly to overcome), but rather that it is concretely rooted in an alienated and divided socioeconomic reality. According to Bondy, the authenticity of Latin American philosophy depends upon the liberation of Latin America from the economic production of its cultural dependence. At the same time, Bondy argues for the inauthenticity of philosophy in Europe and the United States insofar as they depend upon the domination of the Third World. In sum, whereas Zea calls for an authentic philosophical development in Latin America that would critically assimilate the deficiencies of the past, Bondy maintains that liberation from economic domination and cultural dependence is a prerequisite for authentic Latin American philosophy in the future.

Before turning to the next philosophical generation and their philosophies of liberation, it is important to note that there are other major philosophical strands that emerged during the period of normalization (1940-1960). While the period is generally associated with Latin Americanism—which drew upon historicism, existentialism, and phenomenology—other philosophical traditions including Marxism, neo-scholasticism, and analytic philosophy also grew in importance. Important early Latin American analytic philosophers include Vicente Ferreira da Silva (1916-1963) in Brazil, who published work in mathematical logic; Mario Bunge (1919- ) in Argentina and then Canada, who has published extensively in almost all major areas of analytic philosophy; and Héctor-Neri Castañeda (1924-1991) in Guatemala and then the United States, who was a student Wilfrid Sellars (1912-1989) and founded one of the top journals in analytic philosophy, Noûs. Analytic philosophy was further institutionalized in Latin America during the 1960s, especially in Argentina and Mexico, followed by Brazil in the 1970s. In Argentina, Gregorio Kilmovsky (1922-2009) cultivated interest in the philosophy of science, Tomás Moro Simpson (1929- ) did important work in the philosophy of language, and Carlos Alchourrón’s (1931-1996) work on logic and belief revision had an international impact on analytic philosophy and computer science. In Mexico, the Institute of Philosophical Investigations (IIF) and the journal Crítica were both founded in 1967 and continue to serve as focal points for analytic philosophy in Latin America. Notable philosophers at the IIF include Fernando Salmerón (1925-1997), whose major influence was in ethics; Alejandro Rossi (1932-2009), who worked in philosophy of language; and Luis Villoro (1922- ), who works primarily in epistemology and political philosophy. The development of analytic philosophy in Brazil was shaken by the 1964 coup, but resumed in the 1970s. Newton da Costa (1929- ) developed several non-classical logics, most famously paraconsistent logic where certain contradictions are allowed. Oswaldo Chateaubriand (1940- ) has done internationally recognized work in logic, metaphysics, and philosophy of language. Since then, analytic philosophy has continued to grow and develop in Latin America, leading more recently to the 2007 founding of the Asociación Latinoamericana de Filosofía Analítica, whose mission is to promote analytic philosophy through scholarly conferences and other exchanges across Latin America.

e. Generation of 1960: Philosophies of Liberation

After the 1960s, philosophy as a professional academic discipline was well established in Latin America, but it only began to achieve substantial international visibility in the 1970s with the rise of a new generation that developed the philosophy of liberation. The most famous members of this fifth twentieth century generation are from Argentina and include Arturo Andrés Roig (1922-2012), Enrique Dussel (1934- ), and Horacio Cerutti Guldberg (1950- ). The strain of liberation philosophy developed by Ignacio Ellacuría (1930-1989) in El Salvador also stands out as exemplary. In a context marked by violence and political repression, the public philosophical positions of these liberatory thinkers put their lives in jeopardy. Most tragically, Ellacuría was assassinated by a military death squad while chairing the philosophy department of El Salvador’s Universidad Centroamericana. The substantial international impact of the Argentine philosophers of liberation stems in part from their political exile due to the military and state terrorism that characterized the “Dirty War” from 1972-1983. Much like the earlier Spanish transterrados, these philosophers developed and spread their philosophies from their newly adopted countries (Ecuador in the case of Roig, and Mexico in the cases of Dussel and Cerutti Guldberg). Although it should not be confused with the better-known tradition of Latin American liberation theology, Latin American philosophies of liberation emerged from a similar historical and intellectual context that included: a recovery of Latin America’s longstanding preoccupation with political liberation and intellectual independence, the influence of dependency theory in economics, a careful engagement with Marxism, and an emphasis on praxis rooted in an ethical commitment to the liberation of poor or otherwise oppressed groups in the Third World. Yet another parallel strain of Latin American liberationist thought focusing on pedagogy emerged based upon the work of Brazilian philosopher and educator Paulo Freire (1921-1997). Imprisoned and then exiled from Brazil during the military coup of 1964, he developed a vision and method for teaching oppressed peoples (who were often illiterate) how to theorize and practice their own liberation from the dehumanizing socioeconomic conditions that had been imposed upon them. Freire’s book Pedagogy of the Oppressed (1970) drew international attention and became a foundational text in what is now called critical pedagogy.

While Cerutti Guldberg has written the most complete work explaining the intellectual splits that produced different philosophies of liberation—Filosofía de la liberación latinoamericana (2006)—Dussel’s name and work are most widely known given his tremendous efforts to promote the philosophy of liberation through dialogue with famous European philosophers including Karl-Otto Apel (1922- ) and Jurgen Habermas (1929) as well as famous North American philosophers including Richard Rorty (1931-2007) and Charles Taylor (1931- ). By analyzing the relationship between Latin American cultural-intellectual dependence and socioeconomic oppression, Dussel seeks to develop transformational conceptions and practices leading to liberation from both of these conditions. Dussel argues that the progress of European philosophy through the centuries has come at the expense of the vast majority of humanity, whose massive poverty has only rarely appeared as a fundamental philosophical theme. Dussel’s best-known early work Philosophy of Liberation (1980) attempts to foreground, diagnose, and transform the oppressive socioeconomic and intellectual systems that are largely controlled by European and North American interests and power groups at the expense of Third World regions including Latin America. Instead of only pretending to be universal, at the expense of most people who are largely ignored, historical and philosophical progress must be rooted in a global dialogue committed to recognizing and listening to the least heard on their own terms. Influenced by the French philosopher Immanuel Levinas (1906-1995), Dussel highlights the importance of this ethical method, which he calls analectical to contrast it with the totalizing tendencies of the Hegelian dialectic. A prolific author of more than fifty books, Dussel’s later work attempts to systematically develop philosophical principles for a critical ethics of liberation alongside a critical politics of liberation. Dussel’s 1998 book, Ethics of Liberation in the Age of Globalization and Exclusion (translated in 2013), is often cited as an important later work.

While not typically categorized as part of the philosophy of liberation in the narrow sense, Latin American feminist philosophy is an important but typically under-recognized form of emancipatory thought that has existed in academic form for at least a century. In 1914, Carlos Vaz Ferreira (1872-1958) began publicly analyzing and discussing the importance of civil and political rights for women, as well as women’s access to education and professional careers. Vaz Ferreira’s feminist philosophy was published as Sobre feminismo in 1933, the same year that woman gained the right to vote in Uruguay. Given that Vaz Ferreira belongs to the first twentieth century generation of the “patriarchs” of Latin American philosophy, it is worth emphasizing that women were systematically marginalized from the academic discipline of philosophy until much later in the twentieth century, when the feminist movements of the 1970s led to the institutionalization of Women’s Studies or Gender Studies in Latin American universities in the 1980s and 1990s. An important connecting tissue for these movements has been the Encuentros Feminista Latinoamericano y del Caribe, an ongoing series of biennial (later triennial) meetings of Latin American women and feminist activists, first held in 1981 in Bogotá, Colombia. While the diversity that characterizes feminism makes it problematic to make generalized comparisons between Latin American feminism and feminism in Europe and the United States, Latin American feminists have tended to be more concerned with the context of family life and to giving equal importance to ethnicity and class as categories of analysis (Femenías and Oliver 2007). 

One of the earliest and most influential Latin American feminist philosophers was Graciela Hierro (1928-2003), who introduced feminist philosophy into the academic curriculum of the UNAM beginning in the 1970s and organized the first panel on feminism at a national Mexican philosophy conference in 1979. Hierro is best remembered for the feminist ethics of pleasure that she developed beginning with her book Ética y feminismo (1985). Criticizing the “double sexual morality” that assigns asymmetrical moral roles based upon gender, Hierro argues for a hedonistic sexual ethic rooted in a love of self that makes prudence, solidarity, justice, and equity possible. The rise of feminist philosophy alongside other feminist social and intellectual movements in Latin America has also led to the recovery and popularization of writings by marginalized women thinkers, including the work of Sor Juana de la Cruz (1651-1695) discussed above. Another important intellectual resource has been the development of oral history projects or testimonios that seek to document the lives and ideas of countless women living in poverty or obscurity. One of the most famous books in this genre is I, Rigoberta Menchú (1983), the testimonial autobiography of a Quiche Mayan woman, Rigoberta Menchú Tum (1959- ), who began fighting for the rights of women and indigenous people in Guatemala as a teenager and went on to win a Nobel Peace Prize in 1992.

f. Generation of 1980: Globalization, Postmodernism, and Postcolonialism

The sixth and last generation of twentieth century Latin American philosophers emerged in the 1980s. While speaking of broad trends is always somewhat misleading given the diversity of approaches and interests, one interesting trend lies in how Latin American philosophers from this generation have contributed to the analysis and criticism of globalization by participating in new intellectual debates concerning postmodernism in the 1980s and postcolonialism in the 1990s. For example, some new philosophers of liberation like Raul Fornet-Betancourt (1946- ) sought to revise fundamental theoretical dichotomies such as center/periphery, domination/liberation, and First World/Third World that were critical in terms of their general thrust but insufficiently nuanced in light of the complex phenomena that go by the name of globalization. Fornet-Betancourt’s own biography points to this complexity, since he was born in Cuba but moved to Germany in 1972, earning his college degree and first PhD in philosophy in Spain, then returning to complete a second PhD in theology and linguistics in Germany, where he is currently a professor who publishes extensively in both German and Spanish. Self-critical of much of his own philosophical training and development, Fornet-Betancourt has rooted himself in Latin American philosophy in order to devise an intercultural approach to understanding philosophy in light of the diverse histories and cultures that have produced human wisdom across time and space. In contrast to globalization, which is a function of a global political economy that does not tolerate differences or alternatives to a global monoculture of capitalism and consumption, Fornet-Betancourt outlines the economic and political conditions that would make genuinely symmetrical intercultural dialogue and exchange possible.

Drawing critically upon discussions of globalization and postmodernism, the discourse of postcolonialism emerged in the final decade of the twentieth century. The basic idea is that globalization has produced a new transnational system of economic colonialism that is distinct from but related to the national and international forms of colonialism that characterized the world between the conquest of America and the Second World War. Among other things, postcolonialism addresses the politics of knowledge in globalized world that is unified by complex webs of exclusion based upon gender, class, race, ethnicity, language, and sexuality. One of the fundamental criticisms leveled by postcolonialism is the way that neo-colonial discourses routinely and violently construct homogeneous wholes like “The Third World” or “Latin America” out of heterogeneous peoples, places, and their cultures. Like postmodernism, postcolonial theory did not initially come from or focus on Latin America, so there is considerable debate about whether or how postcolonial theory should be developed in a Latin American context. A variant of this debate has occurred among Latin American feminists who do not generally view themselves as part of postcolonial feminism, which has been charged with overlooking tremendous differences between the former English and French colonies and the former Spanish and Portuguese colonies (Schutte and Femenías 2010). One of the best-known Latin American thinkers who works critically in conjunction with postcolonial studies is Walter Mignolo (1941- ). He was born in Argentina, where he completed his B.A. in philosophy before moving to Paris to obtain his Ph.D., eventually becoming a professor in the United States. Rather than apply foreign postcolonial theory to the Latin American context, Mignolo has mined the history of Latin America for authors who found ways to challenge or subversively employ the rules of colonial discourse, for example, the native Andean intellectual and artist Felipe Guamán Poma de Ayala (c.1550-1616) discussed above. Mignolo’s book, The Idea of Latin America (2005), excavates the history of how the idea of Latin America came about in order to show how it still rests upon colonial foundations that must be transformed by decolonial theory and practice.

5. Twenty-First Century

a. Plurality of Philosophies in Latin America

In the early twenty-first century, Latin America became home to the ongoing development and institutionalization of many philosophical traditions and approaches including analytic philosophy, Latin Americanism, phenomenology, existentialism, hermeneutics, Marxism, neo-scholasticism, feminism, history of philosophy, philosophy of liberation, postmodernism, and postcolonialism. At the same time, the very idea of Latin America has been posed as a major problem (Mignolo 2005), following historically in the wake of the still unresolved controversy over how philosophy itself should be understood. While the dominant philosophical currents and trends differ both across and within various Latin American countries and regions, all of the major philosophical approaches that predominate in Europe and the United States are well-represented.

b. Normalization of Latin American Philosophy in the United States

The term “Latin American philosophy” has also gained widespread use and attracted considerable research interest in the United States. This is due in large measure to the efforts of a generation of Latino and Latina philosophers who were born in Latin America and went on to become professors in the United States where they teach and publish in better-established philosophical fields as well as in Latin American philosophy. These philosophers include Walter Mignolo (1941- ), María Lugones (1948- ), and Susana Nuccetelli (1954-) from Argentina; Jorge J. E. Gracia (1942- ) and Ofelia Schutte (1945- ) from Cuba; Linda Martín Alcoff (1955- ) from Panama; and Eduardo Mendieta (1963- ) from Colombia. Their philosophical interests and approaches to Latin American philosophy vary greatly and include postcolonial theory, feminism, metaphysics, epistemology, critical philosophy of race, philosophy of liberation, philosophy of language, metaphilosophy, continental philosophy, and critical theory. This generation has also made important contributions to the analysis of, and debate over, Hispanic or Latino/a identity in the United States, especially as it intersects with other complex dimensions of identity including race, ethnicity, nationality, class, language, gender, and sexual orientation.

Borrowing a term from the history of Latin American philosophy, we may eventually be able to speak of the early twenty-first century as the period of normalization for Latin American philosophy in the United States. Given the accomplishments of the generation of mostly Latino and Latina founders, a few philosophy graduate students in the United States have been the first presented with opportunities to receive some formal training in Latin American philosophy and to make it a major part of their research agenda early in their careers. Moreover, the first handful of job listings at universities in the United States have emerged calling for professors who specialize in Latin American philosophy. The early twenty-first century has also been marked by an increasing number of English-language articles and books on Latin American philosophy. Nevertheless, if this trend toward more development of Latin American philosophy is to continue, then large hurdles remain, including a major shortage of primary Latin American philosophical texts available in English translation, a widespread lack of knowledge concerning Latin American philosophy among most professional philosophers in the United States, and the resulting need for most U.S. philosophers interested in Latin American philosophy to maintain an active research agenda and publication record in at least one better-recognized philosophical area or field.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Alberdi, Juan Bautista. “Foundations and Points of Departure for the Political Organization of the Republic of Argentina.” Translated by Janet Burke and Ted Humphrey. In Nineteenth-Century Nation Building and the Latin American Intellectual Tradition: A Reader. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 2007.
  • Alcoff, Linda Martín. Visible Identities: Race, Gender, and the Self. New York: Oxford University Press, 2006.
  • Arciniegas, Germán. Latin America: A Cultural History. Translated by Joan MacLean. New York: Knopf, 1966.
  • Beorlegui, Carlos. Historia del pensamiento filosofico latinoamericano: una busqueda incesante de la identidad. Bilbao: Universidad de Deusto, 2006.
  • Beorlegui, Carlos . “La Filosofía de Jd García Bacca.” Isegoría, no. 7 (1993): 151-64.
  • Bolívar, Simón. El Libertador: Writings of Simón Bolívar. Translated by Frederick H. Fornoff. Edited by David Bushnell. New York: Oxford University Press, 2003.
  • Bondy, Augusto Salazar. ¿Existe una filosofía de nuestra américa? México: Siglo XXI, 1968.
  • Burke, Janet, and Ted Humphrey, eds. Nineteenth-Century Nation Building and the Latin American Intellectual Tradition: A Reader. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 2007.
  • Cerutti Guldberg, Horacio. Filosofía de la liberación latinoamericana. México: Fondo de Cultura Económica, 2006.
  • Chasteen, John Charles. Born in Blood & Fire: A Concise History of Latin America. New York: W. W. Norton & Company, 2011.
  • Costa, João Cruz. A History of Ideas in Brazil: The Development of Philosophy in Brazil and the Evolution of National History. Translated by Suzette Macedo. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1964.
  • Crawford, William Rex. A Century of Latin-American Thought. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1961.
  • de la Cruz, Sor Juana Inés. The Answer / La Respuesta. Edited and Translated by Electa Arenal and Amanda Powell. New York: Feminist Press at the City University of New York, 2009.
  • de las Casas, Bartolomé. In Defense of the Indians. Translated by Stafford Poole. DeKalb: Northern Illinois University Press, 1992.
  • Dussel, Enrique. Ethics of Liberation: In the Age of Globalization and Exclusion. Translated by Alejandro A. Vallega and Eduardo Mendieta. Durham, NC: Duke University Press, 2013.
  • Dussel, Enrique . Philosophy of Liberation. Translated by Aquilina Martinez and Christine Morkovsky. Eugene, OR: Wipf & Stock Publishers, 1980.
  • Dussel, Enrique . Politics of Liberation: A Critical Global History. Translated by Thia Cooper. Canterbury: SCM Press, 2011.
  • Dussel, Enrique, Eduardo Mendieta, and Carmen Bohórquez, eds. El pensamiento filosofico latinoamericano, del Caribe y “latino” (1300-2000): historia, corrientes, temas y filósofos. México: Siglo XXI, 2009.
  • Ellacuría, Ignacio. Ignacio Ellacuria: Essays on History, Liberation, and Salvation. Edited by Michael E. Lee. Maryknoll, NY: Orbis Books, 2013.
  • Femenías, María Luisa, and Amy A. Oliver, eds. Feminist Philosophy in Latin America and Spain. New York: Rodopi, 2007.
  • Fornet-Betancourt, Raúl. Transformación intercultural de la filosofía: ejercicios teóricos y prácticos de filosofía intercultural desde latinoamérica en el contexto de la globalización. Bilbao: Desclée de Brouwer, 2001.
  • Freire, Paulo. Pedagogy of the Oppressed. Translated by Myra Bergman Ramos. New York: Herder and Herder, 1970.
  • García Bacca, Juan David. Antología del pensamiento filosófico venezolano. Caracas: Ediciones del Ministerio de Educación, 1954.
  • Gracia, Jorge J. E. Hispanic / Latino Identity: A Philosophical Perspective. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 1999.
  • Gracia, Jorge J. E., ed. Latin American Philosophy Today. A Special Double Issue of The Philosophical Forum. Vol. 20:1-2, 1988-89.
  • Gracia, Jorge J. E.. Philosophical Analysis in Latin America. Dordrecht: Reidel, 1984.
  • Gracia, Jorge J. E., and Elizabeth Millán-Zaibert. Latin American Philosophy for the 21st Century: The Human Condition, Values, and the Search for Identity. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books, 2004.
  • Guaman Poma de Ayala, Felipe The First New Chronicle and Good Government [Abridged]. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, 2006.
  • Hierro, Graciela. Ética y feminismo. México: Universidad Nacional Autónoma de México, 1985.
  • Hierro, Graciela . La ética del placer. México: Universidad Nacional Autónoma de México, 2001.
  • Ivan, Marquez, ed. Contemporary Latin American Social and Political Thought: An Anthology. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, 2008.
  • Mariátegui, José Carlos. Seven Interpretive Essays on Peruvian Reality. Translated by Marjory Urquidi. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1971.
  • Martí, José. José Martí Reader: Writings on the Americas. Edited by Deborah Scnookal and Mirta Muñiz. Melbourne: Ocean Press, 2007.
  • Mendieta, Eduardo, ed. Latin American Philosophy: Currents, Issues, Debates. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2003.
  • Mignolo, Walter D. The Darker Side of the Renaissance: Literacy, Territoriality, and Colonization. Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press, 1995.
  • Mignolo, Walter D . The Idea of Latin America. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 2005.
  • Moraña, Mabel, Enrique Dussel, and Carlos A. Jáuregui, eds. Coloniality at Large: Latin America and the Postcolonial Debate. Durham, NC: Duke University Press, 2008.
  • Nuccetelli, Susana, Ofelia Schutte, and Otávio Bueno, eds. A Companion to Latin American Philosophy. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 2010.
  • Nuccetelli, Susana, and Gary Seay. Latin American Philosophy: An Introduction with Readings. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Pearson, 2003.
  • Nuccetelli, Susanna. Latin American Thought: Philosophical Problems and Arguments. Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 2002.
  • Portilla, Miguel León. Aztec Thought and Culture: A Study of the Ancient Nahuatl Mind. Norman: University of Oklahoma Press, 1963.
  • Rodó, José Enrique. Ariel. Translated by Margaret Sayers Peden. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1988.
  • Salles, Arleen, and Elizabeth Millán-Zaibert. The Role of History in Latin American Philosophy: Contemporary Perspectives. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2006.
  • Sánchez Reulet, Aníbal. Contemporary Latin American Philosophy: A Selection with Introduction and Notes. Translated by Willard R. Trask. Albuquerque: The University of New Mexico Press, 1954.
  • Schutte, Ofelia. Cultural Identity and Social Liberation in Latin American Thought. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1993.
  • Schutte, Ofelia, and María Luisa Femenías. “Feminist Philosophy.” In A Companion to Latin American Philosophy, edited by Susana Nuccetelli, Ofelia Schutte and Otávio Bueno. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 2010.
  • Sierra, Justo. The Political Evolution of the Mexican People. Translated by Charles Ramsdell. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1976.
  • Vasconcelos, José. The Cosmic Race: A Bilingual Edition. Translated by Didier T. Jaén. Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1997.
  • Vaz Ferreira, Carlos. Sobre feminismo. Buenos Aires: Editorial Losada, 1945.
  • Zea, Leopoldo. The Latin-American Mind. Translated by James H. Abbott and Lowell Dunham. Norman: University of Oklahoma Press, 1963.
  • Zea, Leopoldo . Latin America and the World. Translated by Beatrice Berler and Frances Kellam Hendricks. Norman: University of Oklahoma Press, 1969.
  • Zea, Leopoldo . Positivism in Mexico. Translated by Josephine H. Schulte. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1974.
  • Zea, Leopoldo . The Role of the Americas in History. Translated by Sonja Karsen. Edited by Amy A. Oliver. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, 1991.


Author Information

Alexander V. Stehn
University of Texas-Pan American
U. S. A.

René Girard (1923— )

Rene GirardRené Girard’s thought defies classification. He has written from the perspective of a wide variety of disciplines: Literary Criticism, Psychology, Anthropology, Sociology, History, Biblical Hermeneutics and Theology. Although he rarely calls himself a philosopher, many philosophical implications can be derived from his work. Girard’s work is above all concerned with Philosophical Anthropology (that is, ‘What is it to be human?’), and draws from many disciplinary perspectives. Over the years he has developed a mimetic theory. According to this theory human beings imitate each other, and this eventually gives rise to rivalries and violent conflicts. Such conflicts are partially solved by a scapegoat mechanism, but ultimately, Christianity is the best antidote to violence.

Perhaps Girard’s lack of specific disciplinary affiliation has promoted a slight marginalization of his work among contemporary philosophers. Girard is not on par with more well known French contemporary philosophers (for example Derrida, Foucault, Deleuze, Lyotard), but his work is becoming increasingly recognized in the humanities, and his commitment as a Christian thinker has given him prominence among theologians.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Mimetic Desire
    1. External Mediation
    2. Internal Mediation
    3. Metaphysical Desire
    4. The Oedipus Complex
  3. The Scapegoat Mechanism
    1. The Origins of Culture
    2. Religion
    3. Ritual
    4. Myth
    5. Prohibitions
  4. The Uniqueness of the Bible and Christianity
    1. The Hebrew Bible
    2. The New Testament
    3. Nietzsche’s Criticism of Christianity
    4. Apocalypse and Contemporary Culture
  5. Theological Implications
    1. God
    2. The Incarnation
    3. Satan
    4. Original Sin
    5. Atonement
  6. Criticisms
    1. Mimetic Theory Claims Too Much
    2. The Origins of Culture are Not Verifiable
    3. Girard Exaggerates the Contrast Between Myths and the Bible
    4. Christian Uniqueness Does Not Imply a Divine Origin
    5. Lack of a Precise Scientific Language
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary
    2. Secondary

1. Life


René Girard was born on December 25, 1923, in Avignon, France. He was the son of a local archivist, and he went on to follow his father’s footsteps. He studied in Paris’ École Nationale des Chartes, and specialized in Medieval studies. In 1947, Girard took the opportunity to emigrate to America, and pursued a doctorate at the University of Indiana. His dissertation was on Americans’ opinions about France. Although his later work has had little to do with his doctoral dissertation, Girard has kept a live interest in French affairs.

After the completion of his doctorate, Girard began to take interest in Jean-Paul Sartre’s work. Although on a personal level Girard is still very much interested in Sartre’s philosophy, it has had little influence on his thought. Girard settled in America, and has taught at different institutions (Indiana University, State University of New York in Buffalo, Duke, Johns Hopkins, Bryn Mawr and Stanford) until his retirement in 1995.

During the beginning of his career as lecturer, Girard was assigned to teach courses on European literature; he admits he was not at all familiar with the great works of European novelists. As Girard began to read the great European novels in preparation for the course, he became especially engaged with the work of five novelists in particular: Cervantes, Stendhal, Flaubert, Dostoyevsky and Proust.

His first book, Mensonge Romantique et Vérité Romanesque (1961), is a literary comment on the works of these great novelists. Until that time, Girard was a self-declared agnostic. As he researched the religious conversions of some of Dostoyevsky’s characters, he felt he had lived a similar experience, and converted to Christianity. Ever since, Girard has been a committed and practicing Roman Catholic.

After the publication of his first book, Girard turned his attention to ancient and contemporary sacrifice rituals, as well as Greek myth and tragedy. This led to another important book, La Violence et le Sacré (1972), for which he gained much recognition. On a personal level, he was a committed Christian, but his Christian views were not publicly expressed until the publication of Des Choses Cachées Depuis la Fondation du Monde (1978), his magnum opus, and best systematization of his thought. Ever since, Girard has written books that expand various aspects of his work. In 2005, Girard was elected to the Académie Française, a very important distinction among French intellectuals.

2. Mimetic Desire

Girard’s fundamental concept is ‘mimetic desire’. Ever since Plato, students of human nature have highlighted the great mimetic capacity of human beings; that is, we are the species most apt at imitation. Indeed, imitation is the basic mechanism of learning (we learn inasmuch as we imitate what our teachers do), and neuroscientists are increasingly reporting that our neural structure promotes imitation very proficiently (for example, ‘mirror neurons’).

However, according to Girard, most thinking devoted to imitation pays little attention to the fact that we also imitate other people’s desires, and depending on how this happens, it may lead to conflicts and rivalries. If people imitate each other’s desires, they may wind up desiring the very same things; and if they desire the same things, they may easily become rivals, as they reach for the same objects. Girard usually distinguishes ‘imitation’ from ‘mimesis’. The former is usually understood as the positive aspect of reproducing someone else’s behavior, whereas the latter usually implies the negative aspect of rivalry. It should also be mentioned that because the former usually is understood to refer to mimicry, Girard proposes the latter term to refer to the deeper, instinctive response that humans have to each other.

a. External Mediation

Girard calls ‘mediation’ the process in which a person influences the desires and preferences of another person. Thus, whenever a person’s desire is imitated by someone else, she becomes a ‘mediator’ or ‘model’. Girard points out that this is very evident in publicity and marketing techniques: whenever a product is promoted, some celebrity is used to ‘mediate’ consumers’ desires: in a sense, the celebrity is inviting people to imitate him in his desire of the product. The product is not promoted on the basis of its inherent qualities, but simply because of the fact that some celebrity desires it.

In his studies on literature, Girard highlights this type of relationship in his literary studies, as for example in his study of Don Quixote. Don Quixote is mediated by Amadis de Gaula. Don Quixote becomes an errant knight, not really because he autonomously desires so, but in order to imitate Amadis. Nevertheless, Amadis and Don Quixote are characters on different planes. They will never meet, and in such a manner, they never become rivals.

The same can be said of the relation between Sancho and Don Quixote. Sancho desires to be governor of an island, mostly because Don Quixote has suggested to Sancho that that is what he should desire. Again, although they interact continuously, Sancho and Don Quixote belong to two different worlds: Don Quixote is a very complex man, Sancho is simple in extreme. Girard calls ‘external mediation’ the situation when the mediator and the person mediated are on different planes. Don Quixote is an ‘external mediator’ to Sancho, inasmuch as he mediates his desires ‘from the outside’; that is, Don Quixote never becomes an obstacle in Sancho’s attempts to satisfy his desires.

External mediation does not carry the risk of rivalry between subjects, because they belong to different worlds. Although the source of Sancho’s desire to be governor of an island is in fact Don Quixote, they never desire the same object. Don Quixote desires things Sancho does not desire, and vice versa. Hence, they never become rivals. Girard believes ‘external mediation’ is a frequent feature of the psychology of desire: from our earliest phase as infants, we look up in imitation to our elders, and eventually, most of what we desire is mediated by them.

b. Internal Mediation

In ‘internal mediation’, the ‘mediator’ and the person mediated are no longer abysmally separated and hence, do not belong to different worlds. In fact, they come to resemble each other to the point that they end up desiring the same things. But, precisely because they are no longer on different worlds and now reach for the same objects of desire, they become rivals. We are fully aware that competition is fiercer when competitors resemble each other.

Thus, in internal mediation the subject imitates the model’s desires, but ultimately, unlike external mediation, the subject falls into rivalry with the model/mediator. Consider this example: a toddler imitates his father in his occupations, and he desires to pursue his father’s career when he grows up. This will hardly cause any rivalry (although it may account for Freud’s Oedipus Complex; see section 2.d). This is, as we have seen, a case of external mediation. But, now consider a PhD candidate that learns a great deal from his supervisor, and seeks to imitate every aspect of his work, and even his life. Eventually, they may become rivals, especially if both are looking for scholarly recognition. Or, consider further the case of a toddler that is playing with a toy, and another toddler that, out of imitation, desires that very same toy: they will eventually become rivals for the control of the toy. This is ‘internal mediation’; that is the person is mediated from the ‘inside’ of his world, and therefore, may easily become his mediator’s rival. This rivalry often has tragic consequences, and Girard considers this a major theme in modern novels. In Girard’s view, this literary theme is in fact a portrait of human nature: very often, people will desire something as a result of imitating other people, but eventually, this imitation will lead to rivalries with the very person imitated in the first place.

c. Metaphysical Desire

In Girard’s view, mimetic desire may grow to such a degree, that a person may eventually desire to be her mediator. Again, publicity is illustrative: sometimes, consumers do not just desire a product for its inherent qualities, but rather, desire to be the celebrity that promotes such a product. Girard considers that a person may desire an object only as part of a larger desire; that is, to be her mediator. Girard calls the desire to be other people, ‘metaphysical desire’. Furthermore, acquisitive desire leads to metaphysical desire, and the original object of desire becomes a token representing the “larger” desire of having the being of the model/rival.

Whereas external mediation does not lead to rivalries, internal mediation does lead to rivalries. But, metaphysical desire leads a person not just to rivalry with her mediator; actually, it leads to total obsession with and resentment of the mediator. For, the mediator becomes the main obstacle in the satisfaction of the person’s metaphysical desire. Inasmuch as the person desires to be his mediator, such desire will never be satisfied. For nobody can be someone else. Eventually, the person developing a metaphysical desire comes to appreciate that the main obstacle to be the mediator is the mediator himself.

According to Girard, metaphysical desire can be a very destructive force, as it promotes resentment against others. Girard considers that the anti-hero of Dostoyevsky’s Notes From the Underground is the quintessential victim of metaphysical desire: the unnamed character eventually goes on a crusade against the world, as he is disillusioned with everything around him. Girard believes that the origin of his alienation is his dissatisfaction with himself, and his obsession to be someone else; that is, an impossible task.

d. The Oedipus Complex

Girard’s career has been mostly devoted to literary criticism, and the analysis of fictional characters. Girard believes that the great modern novelists (such as Stendhal, Flaubert, Proust and Dostoevsky) have understood human psychology better than the modern field of Psychology does. And, as a complement of his literary criticism, he has developed a psychology in which the concept of ‘mimetic desire’ is central. Inasmuch as human beings constantly seek to imitate others, and most desires are in fact borrowed from other people, Girard believes that it is crucial to study how personality relates to others.

Departing from the main premise of mimetic desire, Girard has sought to reformulate some of psychology’s long-held assumptions. In particular, Girard seeks to reconsider some of Freud’s concepts. Although Girard has been careful enough to warn that Freud’s thought may be highly misleading in many ways, he has been engaged with Freud’s work in a number of ways. Girard admits that Freud and his followers had some good initial intuitions, but criticizes Freudian psychoanalytic theory on the grounds that it tends to obviate the role that other individuals have on the development of personality. In other words, psychoanalysis tends to assume that human beings are largely autonomous, and hence, do not desire in imitation of others.

Girard grants that Freud was a superb observer, but was not a good interpreter. And, in a sense, Girard accepts that there is such a thing as the Oedipus Complex: the child will eventually come to unconsciously have a sexual desire for his mother, and a desire to kill his father; and indeed, perhaps this complex will endure throughout adulthood. But, Girard considers that the Oedipus Complex is the result of a mechanism very different from the one outlined by Freud.

According to Freud, the child has an innate sexual desire towards the mother, and eventually, discovers that the father is an obstacle to the satisfaction of that desire. Girard, on the other hand, reinterprets the Oedipus Complex in terms of mimetic desire: the child becomes identified with his father and imitates him. But, inasmuch as he imitates his father, the child imitates the sexual desire for his mother. Then, his father becomes his model and rival, and that explains the ambivalent feelings so characteristic of the Oedipus Complex.

3. The Scapegoat Mechanism

In Girard’s psychology, internal mediation and metaphysical desire eventually lead to rivalry and violence. Imitation eventually erases the differences among human beings, and inasmuch as people become similar to each other, they desire the same things, which leads to rivalries and a Hobbesian war of all against all. These rivalries soon bear the potential to threaten the very existence of communities. Thus, Girard asks: how is it possible for communities to overcome their internal strife?

Whereas the philosophers of the 18th century would have agreed that communal violence comes to an end due to a social contract, Girard believes that, paradoxically, the problem of violence is frequently solved with a lesser dose of violence. When mimetic rivalries accumulate, tensions grow ever greater. But, that tension eventually reaches a paroxysm. When violence is at the point of threatening the existence of the community, very frequently a bizarre psychosocial mechanism arises: communal violence is all of the sudden projected upon a single individual. Thus, people that were formerly struggling, now unite efforts against someone chosen as a scapegoat. Former enemies now become friends, as they communally participate in the execution of violence against a specified enemy.

Girard calls this process ‘scapegoating’, an allusion to the ancient religious ritual where communal sins were metaphorically imposed upon a he-goat, and this beast was eventually abandoned in the desert, or sacrificed to the gods (in the Hebrew Bible, this is especially prescribed in Leviticus 16).The person that receives the communal violence is a ‘scapegoat’ in this sense: her death or expulsion is useful as a regeneration of communal peace and restoration of relationships.

However, Girard considers it crucial that this process be unconscious in order to work. The victim must never be recognized as an innocent scapegoat (indeed, Girard considers that, prior to the rise of Christianity, ‘innocent scapegoat’ was virtually an oxymoron; see section 4.b below); rather, the victim must be thought of as a monstrous creature that transgressed some prohibition and deserved to be punished. In such a manner, the community deceives itself into believing that the victim is the culprit of the communal crisis, and that the elimination of the victim will eventually restore peace.

a. The Origins of Culture

Girard believes that the scapegoat mechanism is the very foundation of cultural life. Natural man became civilized, not through some sort of rational deliberation embodied in a social contract, (as it was fashionable to think among 18th century philosophers) but rather, through the repetition of the scapegoat mechanism. And, very much as many philosophers of the 18th Century believed that their descriptions of the natural state were in fact historical, Girard believes that, indeed, Paleolithic men continually used the scapegoat mechanism, and it was precisely this feature what allowed them to lay the foundations of culture and civilization.

In fact, Girard believes that this process goes farther back in the evolution of Homo sapiens: hominids probably were engaged in scapegoating. But, it was precisely scapegoating what allowed a minimum of communal peace among early hominid groups. Hominids could eventually develop their main cultural traits due to the efficiency of the scapegoat mechanism. The murder of a victim brought forth communal peace, and this peace promoted the flourishing of the most basic cultural institutions.

Once again, Girard takes deep inspiration from Freud, but reinterprets his observations. Freud’s Totem and Taboo presents a thesis that the origins of culture are founded upon the original murder of a father figure by his sons. Girard considers that Freud’s observations were only partially correct. Freud is right in pointing out that indeed, culture is founded upon a murder. But, this murder is not due to the oedipal themes Freud was so fond of. Instead, the founding murder is due to the scapegoat mechanism. The horde murdered a victim (not necessarily a father figure) in order to project upon her all the violence that was threatening the very existence of the community.

However, as mimetic desire has been a constant among human beings, scapegoating has never been entirely efficient. Nevertheless, human communities need to periodically recourse to the scapegoating mechanism in order to maintain social peace.

b. Religion

According to Girard, the scapegoat mechanism brings about unexpected peace. But, this moment is so marvelous, that it soon acquires a religious overtone. Thus, the victim is immediately consecrated. Girard is in the French sociological tradition of Durkheim, who considered that religion essentially accomplishes the function of social integration. In Girard’s view, inasmuch as the deceased victim brings forth communal peace and restores social order and integration, she becomes sacred.

At first, while living, victims are considered to be monstrous transgressors that deserve to be punished. But, once they die, they bring peace to the community. Then, they are not monsters any longer, but rather gods. Girard highlights that, in most primitive societies, there is a deep ambivalence towards deities: they hold high virtues, but they are also capable of performing some very monstrous deeds. That is how, according to Girard, primitive gods are sanctified victims.

In such a manner, all cultures are founded upon a religious basis. The function of the sacred is to offer protection for the stability of communal peace. And, to do this, it ensures that the scapegoat mechanism provides its effects through the main religious institutions.

c. Ritual

Girard considers rituals the earliest cultural and religious institution. In Girard’s view, ritual is a reenactment of the original scapegoating murder. Although, as anthropologists are quick to assert, rituals are very diverse, Girard considers that the most popular form of ritual is sacrifice. When a victim is ritually killed, Girard believes, the community is commemorating the original event that promoted peace.

The original victim was most likely a member of the community. Girard considers that, probably, earliest sacrificial rituals employed human victims. Thus, Aztec human sacrifice may have impacted Western conquistadors and missionaries upon its discovery, but this was a cultural remnant of a popular ancient practice. Eventually, rituals promoted sacrificial substitution, and animals were employed. In fact, Girard considers that hunting and the domestication of animals arose out of the need to continually reenact the original murder with substitute animal victims.

d. Myth

Following the old school of European anthropologists, Girard believes that myths are the narrative corollary of ritual. And, inasmuch as rituals are mainly a reenactment of the original murder, myths also recapitulate the scapegoating themes.

Now, Girard’s crucial point about the necessary unconsciousness of scapegoating: must be kept in mind in order for this mechanism to work, its participants must not recognize it as such. That is to say, the victim must never appear as what it really is: a scapegoat that is no guiltier of disturbance, than other members of the community.

The way to assure that scapegoats are not recognized as what they really are is by distorting the story of the events that led to their death. This is accomplished by telling the story from the perspective of the scapegoaters. Myths will usually tell a story of someone doing a terrible thing and, thus, deserving to be punished. The victim’s perspective will never be incorporated into the myth, precisely because this would spoil the psychological effect of the scapegoating mechanism. The victim will always be portrayed as a culprit whose deeds brought about social chaos, but whose death or expulsion brought about social peace.

Girard’s most recurrent example of myths is that of Oedipus. According to the myth, Oedipus was expelled from Thebes because he murdered his father and married his mother. But, according to Girard, the myth should be read as a chronicle written by a community that chose a scapegoat, blamed him of some crime, punished him, and once expelled, peace returned. Under Girard’s interpretation, the fact that there was a pest in Thebes is suggestive of a social crisis. To solve the crisis, Oedipus is selected as a scapegoat. But, he is never presented as such: quite the contrary, he is accused of parricide and incest, and this justifies his persecution. Thus, Oedipus’ perspective as a victim is suppressed from the myth.

Furthermore, Girard believes that, as myths evolve, later versions will tend to dissimulate the scapegoating violence (for example, instead of presenting a victim who dies by drowning, the myth will just claim that the victim went to live to the bottom of the sea), in order to avoid feeling compassion for the victim. Indeed, Girard considers that the evolution of myths may even reach a point where no violence is present. But, Girard insists, all myths are founded upon violence, and if no violence is found in a myth, it must be because the community made it disappear.

Myths are typical of archaic societies, but Girard thinks that modern societies have the equivalent of myths: persecution texts. Especially during the witch-hunts and persecution of Jews during the Middle Ages, there were plenty of chronicles written from the perspective of the mobs and witch-hunters. These texts told the story of a crisis that appeared as the consequence of some crime committed by a person or a minority. The author of the chronicle is part of the persecuting mob, as he projects upon the victim all the typical accusations, and justifies the mob’s actions. Modern lynching accounts are another prominent example of such persecutory dynamics.

e. Prohibitions

Inasmuch as, under the scapegoaters’ view, there are no innocent scapegoats, an accusation must be made. In the case of Oedipus, he was accused of parricide and incest, and these are recurrent accusations to justify persecution (for example Maria Antoinette), but many other accusations are found (for example blood libels, witchcraft, and so forth). After the victim is executed, Girard claims, a prohibition falls upon the action allegedly perpetrated by the scapegoat. By doing so, the scapegoaters believe they restore social order. Thus, along with ritual and myths, prohibitions derive from the scapegoat mechanism.

Girard also considers that prior to the scapegoating mechanism, communities go through a process he calls a ‘crisis of differences’. Mimetic desire eventually makes every member resemble each other, and this lack of differentiation generates chaos. Traditionally, this indifferentiation is represented through various symbols typically associated with chaos and disorder (plagues, monstrous animals, and so forth). The death of the scapegoat mechanism restores order and, by extension, differentiation. Thus, everything returns to its place. In such a manner, social differentiation and order in general is also derived from the scapegoat mechanism.

4. The Uniqueness of the Bible and Christianity

Girard’s Christian apologetics departs from a comparison of myths and the Bible. According to Girard, whereas myths are caught under the dynamics of the scapegoat mechanism by telling the foundational stories from the perspective of the scapegoaters, the Bible contains plenty of stories that tell the story from the perspective of the victims.

In myths, those who are collectively executed are presented as monstrous culprits that deserve to be punished. In the Bible, those who are collectively executed are presented as innocent victims that are unfairly accused and persecuted. Thus, Girard recapitulates the old Christian apologetic tradition of insisting upon the Bible’s singularity. But, instead of making emphasis on the Bible’s popularity, or fulfillment of prophecies, or consistency, Girard thinks the Bible is unique in its defense of victims.

However, according to Girard, this is not merely a shift in narrative perspective. It is in fact something much more profound. Inasmuch as the Bible presents stories from the perspective of the victims, the Biblical authors reveal something not understood by previous mythological traditions. And, by doing so, they make scapegoating inoperative. Once scapegoats are recognized for what they truly are, the scapegoating mechanism no longer works. Thus, the Bible is a remarkably subversive text, inasmuch as it shatters the scapegoating foundations of culture.

a. The Hebrew Bible

Girard thinks that the Hebrew Bible is a text in travail. There are plenty of stories that are still told from the perspective of the scapegoaters. And, more importantly, it continuously presents a wrathful God that sanctions violence. However, Girard appreciates some important shifts in some narratives from the Bible, especially when they are compared to myths that present similar structures.

For example, Girard contrasts the story of Cain and Abel with the myth of Remus and Romulus. In both stories, there is rivalry between the brothers. In both stories, there is a murder. But, in the Roman myth, Romulus is justified in killing Remus, as the latter transgressed the territorial limits they had earlier agreed upon. In the Biblical story, Cain is never justified in killing Abel. And, indeed, the blood of Abel is evoked as the blood of the innocent victims that have been murdered throughout history, and that God will vindicate.

Girard is also fond of comparing the story of Oedipus with the story of Joseph. Oedipus is accused of incest, and the myth accepts this accusation, therefore justifying his expulsion from Thebes. Joseph is also accused of incest (he allegedly attempted to rape Potiphar’s wife, his de facto step mother). But, the Bible never accepts such an accusation.

In Girard’s views, the Hebrew Bible is also crucial in its rejection of ritual sacrifice. Some prophets vehemently denounced the grotesque ritual killing of sacrificial victims, although, of course, the ritual requirement of sacrificial rituals permeates much of the Old Testament. Girard understands this as a complementary approach to the defense of victims. The prophets promote a new concept of the divinity: God is no longer pleased with ritual violence. This is evocative of Hosea’s plea from God: “I want mercy, not sacrifices”. Thus, the Hebrew Bible takes a twofold reversal of culture’s violent foundation: on the one hand, it begins to present the foundational stories from the perspective of the victims; on the other hand, it begins to present a God that is not satisfied with violence and, therefore, begins to dissociate the sacred from the violent.

b. The New Testament

Under Girard’s interpretation, the New Testament is the completion of the process that the Hebrew Bible had begun. The New Testament fully endorses the victims’ perspective, and satisfactorily dissociates the sacred from the violent.

The Passion story is central in the New Testament, and it is the complete reversal of traditional myth’s structure. Amidst a huge social crisis, a victim (Jesus) is persecuted, blamed of some fault, and executed. Even the apostles succumb to the collective pressure and abandon Jesus, tacitly becoming part of the scapegoating crowd. This is emblematic in the story of Peter’s denial of Jesus.

Nevertheless, the evangelists never succumb to the collective pressure of the scapegoating mob. The evangelists adhere to Jesus’ innocence throughout the whole story. Alas, Jesus is finally recognized as what he really is: an innocent scapegoat, the Lamb of God that was taken to the slaughterhouse, although no fault was in him. According to Girard, this is the completion of a slow process begun in the Hebrew Bible. Once and for all, the New Testament reverses the violent psychosocial mechanism upon which human culture has been founded.

Aside from that, Jesus’ ethical message is complementary. Under Girard’s interpretation, humanity has achieved social peace by performing violent acts of scapegoating. Jesus’ solution is much more radical and efficient: to turn the other cheek, to abstain from violent retribution. Scapegoating is not an efficient means to bring about peace, as it always depends on the periodic repetition of the mechanism. The real solution is in the total withdrawal from violence, and that is the bulk of Jesus’ message.

c. Nietzsche’s Criticism of Christianity

Girard is bothered by the possibility that his readers may fail to appreciate the uniqueness of the Bible and Christianity. In this sense, Girard is very critical of classical anthropologists such as Sir James Frazer, who saw the relevance of scapegoating in primitive rituals and myths, but, according to Girard, failed to see that the Christian story is fundamentally different from other scapegoating myths.

Indeed, Girard resents the fact that Christianity is usually considered to be merely one among many other religions. However, ironically, Girard seeks help from a powerful opponent of Christianity: Friedrich Nietzsche. Nietzsche criticized Christianity for its ‘slave morality’; that is, its tendency to side with the weak. Nietzsche recognized that, above other religions, Christianity promoted mercy as a virtue. Nietzsche interpreted this as a corruption of the human vital spirit, and advocated a return to the pre-Christian values of power and strength.

Girard is, of course, opposed to the Nietzschean disdain for mercy and antipathy towards the weak and victims. But, Girard considers Nietzsche a genius, inasmuch as the German philosopher saw what, according to Girard, most people (including the majority of Christians) fail to see: Christianity is unique in its defense of victims. Thus, in a sense, Girard claims that his Christian apologetics is for the most part a reversal of Nietzsche: they both agree that Christianity is singular, but whereas Nietzsche believed this singularity corrupted humanity, Girard believes this singularity is the manifestation of a power that reverses the violent foundations of culture.

d. Apocalypse and Contemporary Culture

Girard acknowledges that, on the surface, not everything in the New Testament is about peace and love. Indeed, there are some frightening passages in Jesus’ preaching, perhaps the most emblematic “I come not to bring peace, but a sword”. This is part of the apocalyptic worldview prevalent in Jesus’ days. But, much more than that, Girard believes that the apocalyptic teachings to be found in the New Testament are a warning about future human violence.

Girard considers that, inasmuch as the New Testament overturns the old scapegoating practices, humanity no longer has the capacity to return to the scapegoating mechanism in order to restore peace. Once victims are revealed as innocent, scapegoating can no longer be relied upon to restore peace. And, in such a sense, there is now an even greater threat of violence. According to Girard, Jesus brings a sword, not in the sense that he himself is going to execute violence, but in the sense that, through his work and the influence of the Bible, humanity will not have the traditional violent means to put an end to violence. The inefficacy of the scapegoat mechanism will bring even more violence. The way to restore peace is not through the scapegoat mechanism, but rather, through the total withdrawal of violence.

Thus, Girard believes that, ironically, Christianity has brought about even more violence. But, once again, this violence is not attributable to Christianity itself, but rather, to the stubbornness of human beings who do not want to follow the Christian admonition and insist on putting an end to violence through traditional scapegoating.

Girard believes that, 20th and 21st centuries are more than ever an apocalyptic age. And, once again, he acknowledges a 19th century German figure as a precursor of these views: Carl von Clausewitz. According to Girard, the great Prussian war strategist realized that modern war would no longer be an honorable enterprise, but rather, a brutal activity that has the potential to destroy all of humanity. Indeed, Girard believes 20th and 21st centuries are apocalyptic, but not in the fundamentalist sense. The ‘signs’ of apocalypse are not numerical clues such as 666, but rather, signs that humanity has not found an efficient way to put an end to violence, and unless the Christian message of repentance and withdrawal from violence is assumed, we are headed towards doomsday; not a Final Judgment brought forth by a punishing God, but rather, a doomsday brought about by our own human violence.

5. Theological Implications

Girard claims not to be a theologian, but rather, a philosophical anthropologist. But, echoing Simone Weil, he believes that the gospels, inasmuch as they reveal the nature of human beings, also indirectly reveal the nature of God. Thus, Girard’s work has great implications for theologians, and his work has generated new ways to interpret the traditional Christian doctrines.

a. God

Girard is little concerned with the classical theistic attempt to prove the existence of God (for example Aquinas, Plantinga, Craig and Swinburne). But, he does seem to assume that the only way to explain the Bible’s uniqueness in its rejection of scapegoating distortion and its refusal to succumb to the mob’s influence, is by proposing the intervention of a higher celestial power. So, in a weak sense, Girard’s apologetic works try to prove that the Bible is divinely inspired and, therefore, that God exists.

More importantly, Girard believes that the Bible reveals that the true God is far removed from violence, whereas gods that sanction violence are false gods, that is, idols. By revealing how human violence works, Girard claims, the Bible reveals that this violence does not come from God; rather, God sympathizes with victims and wants nothing to do with victimizers.

b. The Incarnation

Furthermore, the doctrine of Incarnation becomes especially important under Girard’s interpretation. For God himself incarnates in the person of Jesus, in order to become himself a victim. Thus, God is so far removed from aggressors and scapegoaters, He himself becomes a victim in order to show humanity that He sides with innocent victims. Thus, the way to overturn the scapegoat mechanism is not only by telling the stories from the perspective of the victim, but also by telling the story that the victim itself is God incarnate.

c. Satan

Most liberal contemporary Christians pay little attention to Satan, but Girard wishes to keep its relevance. Girard has little patience for the literal mythological interpretation of Satan as the red, horned creature. According to Girard, the concept of Satan and the Devil most frequently referred to in the gospels is what it etymologically expresses: the opponent, the accuser. And, in this sense, Satan is the scapegoating mechanism itself (or, perhaps more precisely, the accusing process); that is, the psychological processes in which human beings are caught up by the lynching mob, and eventually succumb to its influence and participate in the collective violence against the scapegoat.

Likewise, the Holy Spirit in Girard’s interpretation is the reverse of Satan. Again, Girard recurs to etymology: the Paraclete etymologically refers to the spirit of defense. Thus, Satan accuses victims, and the Paraclete mercifully defends victims. Thus, the Holy Spirit is understood by Girard as the overturning of the old scapegoating practices.

d. Original Sin

In the old Pelagian-Augustinian debate over original sin, Girard’s work clearly sides with Augustine. Under Girard’s interpretation, there is a twofold sense of original sin: 1) human beings are born with the propensity to imitate each other and, eventually, be led to violence; 2) human culture was laid upon the foundations of violence. Thus, human nature is tainted by an original sin, but it can be saved through repentance materialized in the withdrawal from violence.

The complementary aspect of the original sin debate, that is, free will, has not been tackled by Girard. But, being a Roman Catholic, it is presumable that Girard would not accept the Calvinist concepts of total depravity, irresistible grace and predestination. He seems to believe that human beings are born with sin, but they have the capacity to do something about it through repentance.

e. Atonement

Girard’s vision of Christianity also brings forth a new interpretation of the doctrine of atonement, that is, that Christ died for our sins. Anselm’s traditional account (God’s honor was offended by the sins of mankind, His honor was reestablished with the death of His own son), or other traditional interpretations (mankind was kidnapped by the Devil, God offered Christ as a ransom; Jesus died so God could show humanity what He is capable of doing if we do not repent, and so forth) are deemed inadequate by Girard. Under Girard’s interpretation, Jesus saved us by becoming a victim and overturning once and for all the scapegoat mechanism. Thanks to Jesus’ salvific mission, human beings now have the capacity to understand what scapegoats really are, and have the golden opportunity to achieve enduring social peace.

6. Criticisms

An important source of criticisms against Girard is his apologetic commitment to Christianity. Most critics argue that he has a tendency to twist interpretations of classical texts and myths in order to favor Christian doctrine. Girard has frequently asserted that he was not a Christian for the early part of his life, but that his work as a humanist eventually drove him to Christianity. Also, Girard has been seen with contempt by postmodernist critics who, on the whole, are suspicious of objective truth.

a. Mimetic Theory Claims Too Much

The first point of criticism directed at Girard is that he is too ambitious. His initial plausible interpretations of mimetic psychology and anthropology are eventually transformed into a grandiose theoretical system that attempts to explain every aspect of human nature.

Consequently, in such a manner, his methods have been questioned. His theories regarding mimetic desire are derived, not from a careful study of subjects and the implementation of tests, but rather, from the reading of works of fiction. The fact that his theory seems to coincide with what many neuroscientists are informing us about mirror neurons is immaterial: his was just a lucky guess.

The same critique may be extended to his work on the origins of culture. Again, his scapegoating thesis may be plausible, in as much as it is easy to find many examples of scapegoating processes in human culture. But, to claim that all human culture ultimately relies on scapegoating, and that the fundamental cultural institutions (myths, rituals, hunting, domestication of animals, and so forth), are ultimately derived from an original murder, is perhaps too much.

Thus, in a sense, Girard’s work is subject to the same criticism of many of the great theoretical systems of the human sciences in the 19th century (Hegel, Freud, Marx, and so forth): his sole concentration on his favorite themes makes him overlook equally plausible alternate explanations for the phenomena he highlights.

b. The Origins of Culture are Not Verifiable

As a corollary of the previous objection, empirically-minded philosophers would object that Girard’s theses are not verifiable in a meaningful way. There is little possibility to know what may have happened during Paleolithic times, apart from what paleontology and archaeology might tell us.

In some instances, Girard claims that his theses have indeed been verified. There have been plenty of archaeological remains that suggest ritual human sacrifice, and plenty of contemporary rituals and myths that suggest scapegoating violence. But, then again, the number of rituals and myths that do not display violence is even greater. Girard does not see this as a great obstacle to his theses, because according to him, cultures have a tendency to erase the track of original violence.

But, in such a case, the empirically-minded philosopher may argue that Girard’s work is not falsifiable in Popper’s sense. There seems to be no possibility of a counter-example that will refute Girard’s thesis. If a violent myth or ritual is considered, Girard will argue that this piece of evidence confirms his hypotheses. If, on the other hand, a non-violent myth or ritual is considered, Girard will once again argue that this piece of evidence confirms his evidence, because it proves that cultures erase tracks of violence in myths and rituals. Thus, Girard is open to the same Popperian objection leveled against Freud: both sexual and non-sexual dreams confirm psychoanalytic theory; therefore, there is no possible way to refute it, and in such a manner, it becomes a meaningless theory.

c. Girard Exaggerates the Contrast Between Myths and the Bible

Girard is also open to criticism inasmuch as his Christian apologetics seems to rely on an already biased comparison of myths and the Bible. It has been objected that he is not thoroughly fair in the application of standards when contrasting the Bible and myths. Girard’s hermeneutic goes to great lengths to highlight violence in rituals when, in fact, it is not all that evident. He may be accused of being predisposed to find sanctioned violence in myths and, based upon that predisposition, he interprets as sanctioned violence mythical elements that, under another interpretative lens, would not be violent at all. Metaphorically speaking, when studying many myths, Girard is just seeing faces in the clouds, and projecting upon myths some elements that are far from being clear.

In the same manner, one may object that Girard’s treatment of the Bible, and especially the New Testament, is too benevolent. Most secular historians would agree that there are some hints of persecution against the Jews in the gospels (for example, an exaggeration of Jewish guilt in the arrest and execution of Jesus), and that the historical Jesus’ apocalyptic preaching is not just a warning of future human violence, but rather, an announcement of imminent divine wrath.

d. Christian Uniqueness Does Not Imply a Divine Origin

Even if Girard’s thesis about the uniqueness of Christianity were accepted, it needn’t prove a divine origin. Perhaps Christianity is unique due to a set of historical and sociological circumstances that drove biblical authors to sympathize with victims (indeed, Max Weber’s explanation is as follows: the Bible’s authors sympathize with victims because they were themselves victims as subjects of the great empires of the Near East). In such a manner, Girard may be accused of incurring an ad ignorantiam fallacy. The fact that we cannot currently explain a given phenomenon does not imply that such phenomenon’s origins are supernatural.

e. Lack of a Precise Scientific Language

Even if one were to accept that the Bible reveals a profound nature about human beings, scientifically-minded philosophers would object that Girard’s language is too obscure and too religiously-based for scientific purposes. Perhaps the Bible does reveal some interesting insights about the nature of scapegoating. But, to name such a process ‘Satan’, or to name the human tendency to incur in rivalries ‘sin’, bears a great potential for confusion. Whenever most readers encounter the word ‘Satan’, they are prone to imagine the nasty horned tailed creature, and not in some sort of abstract psychological mechanism that gives rise to scapegoating violence. So, even if Girard’s use of those terms is metaphoric, they are easily open to confusion, and perhaps should be abandoned.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary

  • Deceit, Desire, and the Novel: Self and Other in Literary Structure. Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press, 1965.
  • Resurrection from the Underground: Feodor Dostoevsky. New York: Crossroad, 1997.
  • Violence and the Sacred. Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press, 1977.
  • Things Hidden since the Foundation of the World. Research undertaken in collaboration with Jean-Michel Oughourlian and Guy Lefort. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1987.
  • "To Double Business Bound": Essays on Literature, Mimesis, and Anthropology. Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press, 1978.
  • The Scapegoat. Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press, 1986.
  • Job: The Victim of His People. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1987
  • A Theater of Envy: William Shakespeare. St. Augustine's Press, 2004.
  • Quand ces choses commenceront...Entretiens avec Michel Treguer. Paris: Arléa, 1994.
  • The Girard Reader. Edited by James G. Williams. New York: Crossroad, 1996.
  • I See Satan Fall like Lightning. Maryknoll, NY: Orbis Books, 2001.
  • Celui par qui le scandale arrive: Entretiens avec Maria Stella Barberi. Paris: Brouwer, 2001.
  • Oedipus Unbound: Selected Writings on Rivalry and Desire. Edited by Mark Anspach. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 2004.
  • Evolution and Conversion: Dialogues on the Origins of Culture. With Pierpaolo Antonello and Joao Cezar de Castro Rocha. London: T&T Clark/Continuum, 2007
  • Christianity, Truth, and Weakening Faith: A Dialogue. René Girard and Gianni Vattimo. Edited by Pierpaolo Antonello and translated by William McCuaig. New York: Columbia University Press, 2010
  • Battling to the End: Conversations with Benoît Chantre. East Lansing, MI: Michigan State University Press, 2010.
  • Anorexie et désir mimétique. Herne, 2008.

b. Secondary

  • ALBERG, Jeremiah. A Reinterpretation of Rousseau: A Religious System. Foreward by René Girard. Palgrave Macmillan, 2007. Hardcover
  • ALISON, James. Broken Hearts and New Creations: Intimations of a Great Reversal. New York: Continuum, 2010.
  • ALISON, James. Faith Beyond Resentment: Fragments Catholic and Gay. New York: Crossroad, 2001
  • ALISON, James. The Joy of Being Wrong: Original Sin Through Easter Eyes. New York: Crossroad, 1998.
  • ANDRADE, Gabriel. René Girard: Um retrato intellectual. E realizacaoes. 2011.
  • ASTELL, Ann W. Joan of Arc and Sacrificial Authorship. South Bend, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 2003
  • BAILIE, Gil. Violence Unveiled: Humanity at the Crossroads. New York: Crossroad, 1995. Paper.
  • BANDERA, Cesáreo. The Humble Story of Don Quixote: Reflections on the Birth of the Modern Novel. Catholic University of America Press, 2006.
  • BANDERA, Cesáreo. The Sacred Game. Penn State Press. 2004.
  • BARTLETT, Anthony. Cross Purposes: The Violent Grammar of Christian Atonement. Valley Forge, PA: Trinity Press International, 2001.
  • BELLINGER, Charles K. The Genealogy of Violence: Reflections on Creation, Freedom, and Evil. Oxford University Press, 2001.
  • DALY, Robert J., S. J. Sacrifice Unveiled: The True Meaning of Christian Sacrifice. London: T&T Clark / New York: Continuum, 2009.
  • DUMOCHEL, Paul, ed. Violence and Truth: on the Work of René Girard. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1988.
  • FINAMORE, Stephen. God, Order, and Chaos: René Girard and the Apocalypse. Eugene, OR: Wipf & Stock, 2009.
  • FLEMING, Chris. René Girard: Violence and Mimesis. Cambridge, Eng.: Polity Press, 2004.
  • FREUD, Sigmund. Totem and Taboo. Create Space. 2011.
  • GOLSAN, Richard J. René Girard and Myth: An Introduction. New York: Routledge, 2001
  • GOODHART, Sandor; Jorgensen, Jorgen; Ryba, Thomas; Williams, James G.; eds. For René Girard: Essays in Friendship and in Truth. East Lansing, MI: Michigan State University Press, 2009.
  • GOODHART, Sandor; Jorgensen, Jorgen; Ryba, Thomas; Williams, James G.; eds. Sacrificing Commentary: Reading the End of Literature. Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1996.
  • GRANDE, Per Bjørnar. Mimesis and Desire: An Analysis of the Religious Nature of Mimesis and Desire in the Work of René Girard. LAP Lambert Academic Publishing, 2009. Paperback: 224 pages.
  • GROTE, Jim and McGeeney, John. Clever as Serpents: Business Ethics and Office Politics. Collegeville, MN: The Liturgical Press, 1997. Paperback, 149 pages.
  • HAMERTON-KELLY, Robert G, ed. Politics & Apocalypse. East Lansing, MI: Michigan State University Press, 2007.
  • HAMERTON-KELLY, Robert G, ed. Sacred Violence: Paul's Hermeneutic of the Cross. Minneapolis: Fortress Press, 1992 .
  • HAMERTON-KELLY, Robert G, ed. The Gospel and the Sacred: Poetics of Violence in Mark. Minneapolis: Fortress Press, 1994
  • of the victim."
  • HOBBES, Thomas. Leviathan. Oxford UP. 2009.
  • KIRK-DUGGAN, Cheryl A. Refiner's Fire: A Religious Engagement with Violence. Minneapolis: Fortress Press, 2001
  • KIRWAN, Michael. Discovering Girard. Cambridge, MA: Cowley Publications, 2005.
  • LEFEBURE, Leo D. Revelation, the Religions, and Violence. Maryknoll, NY: Orbis Books, 2000.
  • MCKENNA, Andrew J. Violence and Difference: Girard, Derrida, and Deconstruction. Chicago: University of Illinois Press, 1992.
  • OUGHOURLIAN, Jean-Michel. The Genesis of Desire. E. Lansing, MI: Michigan State University Press, 2010.
  • Chicago: University of Illinois Press, 1992.
  • OUGHOURLIAN, Jean-Michel. The Puppet of Desire: The Psychology of Hysteria, Possession, and Hypnosis. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1991.
  • SCHWAGGER, Raymund, S.J. Banished from Eden: Original Sin and Evolutionary Theory in the Drama of Salvation. Gracewing, 2006.
  • SWARTLEY, Willard M., editor. Violence Renounced: René Girard, Biblical Studies, and Peacemaking. Response by René Girard and Foreward by Diana M. Culbertson. Telford, PA: Cascadia Publishing House, 2000.
  • WILLIAMS, James G. The Bible, Violence, and the Sacred: Liberation from the Myth of Sanctioned Violence. Foreword by René Girard. Eugene, OR: Wipf & Stock, 2007.


Author Information

Gabriel Andrade
University of Zulia


Personalism is any philosophy that considers personality the supreme value and the key to the measuring of reality. Its American form took root in the late nineteenth century, flowered in the twentieth century, and continues its life in the twenty-first century. Yet, those roots can be traced to Europe and back through Western philosophy to the Mediterranean basin. However, Personalism did not originate exclusively in America, Europe, the Mediterranean basin, or in the West. Personalism thrived in India through the six orthodox schools of Indian philosophy scattered along the Indus River Valley of the Indian subcontinent, and developed parallel to Personalism in the West.

Personalists claim that the person is the key in the search for self-knowledge, for correct insight into reality, and for the place of persons in it. Other than giving centrality to the person, Personalism has no other set of principles or unified doctrine. Although many prominent personalists have been theists, this doctrine is not a requirement.  There is also not a common set of methods or definitions, including the definition of person. Respecting that caution, personalists defend the primacy and importance of persons against any attempt to reduce persons either to the Impersonalism of an infrastructure, such as scientific naturalism, or suprastructure, such as metaphysical absolutism. Personalists focus on the concerns of persons living in a personal world. Between the Scylla and Charybdis of either type of Impersonalism, personalists trace the origin of the concept of person and the development of metaphysical personalism from the ancient world to its flowering in Europe and America. Open to the richness of their philosophical tradition, personalists trace their origin and development both on the Indian subcontinent and in the West.

Table of Contents

  1. South and East Asian Personalism
    1. India
    2. China and Japan
  2. Historical Roots of Personalism in the Mediterranean Basin
  3. European Development and Flowering
  4. North American Personalism
    1. Branches of Personalism
    2. Major figures
      1. Harvard University
      2. Boston University
      3. California
    3. African Personalism
    4. American Indian Personalism
  5. Latin American Personalism
  6. Current Trends
  7. References and Further Reading

1. South and East Asian Personalism

a. India

The religious practice and thought spawned by the Vedic (from Veda, “knowledge,” “wisdom”) texts from at least 1500 BCE, form the back drop of Personalism. The term "Hindu" is derived from the river Sindhu (the Indus) where various schools of practice and thought had formed.

Broadly conceived, Personalism in India originates within the main goal of Hindu philosophical inquiry, which is the freedom from misery. Each system of Hindu philosophy seeks to help persons to that end by giving them insight into the nature of ultimate reality and their place in it. These systems advocate self-knowledge, atmavidya, without which the desired freedom is impossible. The nature and destiny of individual persons is the common theme of the six orthodox Hindu philosophical systems: Nyaya, Vaisesika, Sankhya, Yoga, Purva-mimamsa, and Vedanta. The Vaisesika school is frequently lumped together with the Nyaya (“Logic”) school, and Yoga is classically grouped with Sankhya. Each system promises self-knowledge, atmavidya that bonds the systems into a single philosophical tradition.

Seeking freedom from misery through self-knowledge, Hindu personalist schools of thought center on four questions. What is the self? How is it related to the material world? What is the relation of the self to ultimate reality? And, what is the path from pain and misery to liberation?

First, according to each orthodox school, persons are marked by various characteristics, including a permanent and eternal soul (atman) that exists behind the veil of empirical consciousness, and that possesses a physical body (jiva) that exists as part of a changing material world. While it is agreed that the Atman is eternal, unchanging, independent essence, the six orthodox schools differ whether the transcendent I is conscious or unconscious, active or passive. Each school also recognizes that by being connected to the material world persons possess other characteristics, including agency, will, thought, desire, free will, intention, and identity.

Second, personalists focus on the indissoluble reality of the individual soul and on its relation to the empirical consciousness. That soul, the basic reality in humans and all living things, is a transcendent “I,” (atman) and is veiled by a person’s empirical consciousness. It cannot be the object of experience. The empirical consciousness, the experience of objects sensed or being sensed, comes to be interpreted as alien, attributive, essential, adventitious, permanent, or temporary. Schools differ on how to correlate the transcendent “I” and the empirical consciousness. Hindu Personalism views the empirical consciousness as either attributive or alien, monist or dualist.

At one extreme, Sankhya, the oldest school, interprets the dualism of the transcendent “I” and the empirical consciousness as a dualism of spiritual consciousness (purusa) and material nature (prakrti). Purusa is sentient and passive; prakrti is insentient and active. As sentient, purusa experiences products of prakrti and desires emancipation. As passive, purusa can be understood as unaffected and secluded. In Samkhya, the material world is not an illusion; it is real and stands over against the spiritual person. This dualism is motivated by final beatitude. However, achieving it requires, in theistic versions of Sankhya, moral support, compassionate companionship and guidance from a Supreme Being who possesses perfect knowledge and is capable of perfect action.  The Yoga thinker Pantanjali (ca. 300 CE) introduced God into atheistic Samkhyan dualism to satisfy the moral demand of the spiritual aspirant. With that addition, the Samkhyan school becomes a theistic Personalism.

At the other extreme, monism is represented as Advaita Vedanta (non-dualistic Vedanta). Sankara (c. 788-820), the leading expounder of Vedanta (literally, “the end of the Veda”) philosophy, states its principle insight that the self is One with Ultimate Reality (Brahman).  Thus, the transcendent I includes the empirical many and the Divine One.  The triune of Divine One (Brahman), the transcendent I (atman), and the empirical many is a grand unity. Sankara was the most influential Vedanta thinker who espoused the monistic framework as defined in the Upanishadstat vam asi )”Thou art that” or (“Atman is Brahman”).

Self-knowledge is necessary for the soul to enter beatitude, to be one with Brahman. During a person’s life cycle, the caste system prescribed in the Vedas, eliminated the possibility of social movement, from lower to higher caste. Self-knowledge focused on one’s place in the caste system and its accompanying duties. The soul through its life cycle within a caste system sought virtue, allowing reincarnation in a higher caste. In this way, the virtuous soul achieves release from pain and suffering to Nirvana.

Within the unorthodox systems, such as Ajivikas (fatalists) Charvakas (materialists), Jains (who accept the existence of eternal selves but reject the existence of a supreme God) and Buddhism, Personalism does not develop. Ajivikas adopted materialism on the ground that sense-perception was the only valid means of knowledge. The Ajivika materialists questioned the validity of theological and metaphysical theories that do not come within the ambit of sense-experience. This explains why they rejected the religious version of atmavada, the belief in a metaphysical self.

Buddhism was founded by Siddhārtha Gautama (c. 563 BCE to 483 BCE), rejected the doctrines of atman or purusa and accepted instead a causal account (paticcasumuppada) of the human personalituy. The person, for Siddhartha, is a causally connected bundle of psychophysical aggregates (namarupa). Kasulis says, “According to Buddhism, therefore, I am not a self-existent being who chooses with what or how I wish to relate to external circumstances.” (Kasulis, 62-63) A Buddhist Personalism, the Pudgalavada arose two centuries after the lifetime of Siddhartha. Smet says, “The pudgalavadins thought that behind the aggregates or groups (skandha) of mental and physical conditions observed by introspection, there must a substrate. Had not the Budda, in a well-known passage, spoken of the ‘bearer of the burden’ – an expression seeming to indicate some sort of ego underlying the aggregates? At the same time the pudgala could by no means be identified with the Atman, because it was merely an integrating function demanded by the aggregates and expressed by them.” (De Smet. 38) Its teaching came too close to the heresy of the eternalism of the Atman and soon died out.

b. China and Japan

Regarding China and Japan, in neither country’s faiths are persons understood as an eternal essence. The Chinese, deeply influenced by Confucianism (551-479 BCE), believed that humans elevated themselves to a position through examinations and service. The Japanese, deeply influenced by Buddhism, understood persons in terms of their relationships with other humans, nature, and the totality of things. They held to a hierarchical dyadic view of persons.

Parallel to the origin and formation of Personalism in India, China, and Japan, Personalism in the West began in the Mediterranean basin, and through Christianity it spread north to the Atlantic Rim, northern Europe and the British Isles, and America.

2. Historical Roots of Personalism in the Mediterranean Basin

Personalists trace the origin of the ontological nature of persons and their supreme importance as key to understanding of Reality to the confluence of Greco-Roman philosophy and Christian experience and theology. Both made significant contributions to the formation of the concept of person

In its early uses, the individual person had no ontological import. Person is first found in Greek and Roman culture. Its roots lie in the Greek word prosopon that refers to the face consisting of that around and near the eyes (pros + accusative of ops). Soon it designated the masks or faces used in the Greek theatre. Its Latin cognate is persona, probably of Etruscan derivation, phersu.   Persona referred to a mask functioning as loudspeaker (persono, per, “through” + sona, “resound,”  “resound thoroughly”). The mask was worn by actors on stage aiding them by “sounding through” to be heard by an audience. In the Roman theatre persona meant a character and role in tragedy or comedy. In Roman society, the personae of individuals gain their identity, status, and responsibilities from their roles in a hierarchical, honor-shame society. For example, persona came to be used in reference to the king as king, implying a difference between the important social man and the relatively unimportant singular empirical man. By the end of the second century CE persona became a judicial term referring to a Roman citizen as possessor of legal rights, in contrast to a slave who possesses no legal rights, a non-persona

Meanwhile, as Pythagorean, Platonic and Aristotelian philosophical influences continued, individual persons had little philosophical importance. Plato distinguishes between the individual and the universal, and thereby understands the individual through the universal. The individual Socrates participates in the universal, “human being.” To understand the particular “Socrates,” first know the universal, then one can understand and account for the particular. Pythagoras and Plato used the term soma, body, and played on the similarity between soma and sema, body and tomb. Aristotle, against Plato, calls the individual primary substance and the universal conceptual. First substance is that which stands under (hypostasis) a general term referring to whatever stands under something else. But prosopon gained no ontological meaning through that understanding of substance.

Later, persona took on scant ontological meaning among the Stoics and the Neoplatonists. Stoics thought that God forms an ordered universe, a stage on which each human being as rational plays an assigned part. Each prosopon or persona is not only a social role but also the essence of a human being as constituted by God.  Possessing no ontological significance in and of themselves, persons are microcosms of the Macrocosm.

In the eastern Mediterranean among the Jews, the Hebrew word, nephesh is sometimes translated as “person.” However, in ancient Hebrew life and culture no word analogous to prosopon or persona appears. Nephesh is more often translated as soul, life, creature, or self. Nephesh can refer to the animating principle of a physical entity or the existential quality or state of life. Usually referring to a human being as a unified entity, no distinction is made between immaterial and material aspects. Nephesh as a whole is created by God; nephesh is not an attribute of a substance. The form/matter and substance attribute distinctions are foreign to ancient Hebrew thinking. However, beginning with Alexander the Great in the 4th century BCE and continuing through the Roman period, the Eastern Mediterranean was Hellenized. New Testament writers, St. Paul for example, would have known nephesh, prosopon, and persona, likely aware of semantic tensions that later found their way in theological debates within the Christian church.

The different Greek and Hebrew-Christian understandings of person moved into focus in the 4th and 5th centuries CE as the Christian church attempted to work out a satisfactory understanding of the Trinity and the individual personhood of Jesus the Christ. The details of the controversies that arose are beyond the limits here. However, central to the controversy was the understanding of the individual person. During the time of Origen (185-254 CE) under the influence of Plotinus (204-269 CE), personae lacked ontological content. Is an individual person an attribute of being; or is an individual person being who, having been created by the free and independent God and who bears God’s image, is free and dependent? If the former, the Greek metaphysical word, ousia, expresses the Trinity, as in una substantia (God) and tres personae, where Father, Son, and the Holy Spirit are understood as three independent Gods. If the latter, person is not an attribute of ousia, but upostasis. Earlier both ousia and upostasis meant substance. Eventually, they were used separately, ousia referring to substance and upostasis referring to individual person. This means that persona is no longer a kind of mask worn by an ontological substrate, ousia. The Greek Fathers, particularly the Cappadocians, led by Gregory of Nazianus (c. 329 – 389 or 390) understood that individual persons are ontologically ultimate, the central thesis of Personalism. However, an understanding of the interior life of persons lay beyond their metaphysical interests.

The analysis of the interior life of persons fell to Augustine (354 – 430) who continued the substance view by defining  person as “a rational soul using a mortal and earthly body,” (substantia quaedam rationis particeps, regendo corpora accomodata). Nevertheless, a person is one; “a soul in possession of a body does not constitute two persons but one man.” His contribution to Personalism lies elsewhere. His investigation of the inner experience of persons set a new course in philosophy that would not be developed until the modern period. In doing so he developed a key insight of Personalism, an understanding of reality as Person through an understanding of the interior life of persons. He wrote that knowledge of God moves “from the exterior to the interior and from the inferior to the superior.” Further, he argues that in persons, free will is superior to rationality. Yet Augustine continued the metaphysical principle that the higher can affect the lower, but the lower cannot affect the higher.

In the late Roman era or early Middle Ages, the Roman Catholic Church adopted Boethius’ (ca. 480–524 or 525) definition of person, as the Naturæ rationalis individua substantia (an individual substance of a rational nature). In the meantime, the Greek Orthodox Church continued the doctrines of the Cappadocians, particularly Gregory of Nazianus. Though medieval philosophers, such as Thomas Aquinas modified the definition and some such as Scotus and William of Occam were critical, the substance view of person became firmly entrenched in Western philosophy. During the modern period and the nineteenth and twentieth century personalists continued to debate the substance view of persons.

3. European Development and Flowering

As the grand systems of Christendom in the high Middle Ages cracked under the weight of heavy criticisms from Scotus, Occam, Montaigne, and the new science, a new vision arose in the Renaissance, the emerging self. Though the substance view of persons continued, aided by its institutionalization in the Western church, it was soon challenged. Under Pico della Mirandola, Luther, Descartes, and Locke, Augustine’s careful descriptions and insights into the interior life of persons contributed to emerging selves.

Influenced of pyrrhonistic skepticism, Descartes (1596 – 1650) searched for a new foundation for society, culture, and knowledge, one that measures up to the ideal of certainty as in mathematics. He argues that we can know for certain that we exist and that we can doubt every other knowledge claim, including those of the external world. In this way, inspired by new scientific investigations, he raises problems, particularly the mind-body problem. Rather than the view that God created ex nihilo substances with a rational nature, or persons are substances using a body, Descartes contends that God created two substances, res cogitans and res extensa, mind and body. Central to his view of mind is freedom of the will and rationality.  In freedom of the will we find a characteristic of God that is exactly the same as we find in ourselves. God’s reason is so far beyond our finite minds that we cannot with confidence claim that God is rationality. Descartes’ discussion of the interior life of persons in the early 17th century CE continues Augustine’s insights in the late 4th century CE.  However, Descartes’ dualism of two kinds of created substances significantly differs from Boethius’ view that a person is an individual substance with a rational nature. Though modified, the substance of persons persisted.

The dichotomy of thought (res cogitans) and extension (res extensa) raises formidable problems regarding the relation between them, encouraging some philosophers to emphasize one or the other. For example, Hobbes’(1588 – 1679) materialism on the side of extended things, and Berkeley’s (1685-1753 CE) spiritualism on the side of thinking things. Hobbes’ view is a good example of appealing to impersonal principles to account for persons, a view personalists uniformly reject as a form of Impersonalism. Berkeley’s view moves Personalism into modern Idealism (mentalism), in contrast to classical Idealism (Ideaism) such as Plato’s, and against the Impersonalism of materialism. Under the influence of Locke and against any form of materialism, Berkeley took what he believed a common sense approach. Holding to a substance view of person, he claimed that “to be is to be perceived or perceive,” esse est percipi aut percipere. The key lies in the word “exist.” Descartes had said that things exist either as thought or extension. However, thought Berkeley, whenever we use the word “exist” we must assume that the mind is involved perceiving something. And, when we or no other person perceives an object, that object exists due to its being perceived by a cosmic mind, God. The “absolute existence of unthinking things [matter] are words without meaning.” Neither do eternal ideas, Plato’s forms, exist apart from perceiving minds. They are abstractions only.

Descartes’ position helped create a modern version of the One and Many problem, first spawned by the Pre-Socratics. Descartes held that God can be grasped through ideas in the mind. Spinoza (1632 –1677) responded that God as substance is not dependent on any other than itself. If God could be grasped through a dependent substance, such as thought, God would be dependent on something other than God’s self for God’s existence. Here, two fundamental characteristics of Personalism were threatened, the rational relation of finite persons to God, and persons as free. Since knowledge of the Cosmic Person through a finite person challenges God as Substance, the relation of the Cosmic Person to finite person becomes problematic. Furthermore, persons as free can be held only so long as Cosmic Person and finite persons are in some way independent. Spinoza claimed that substance can be known only through itself, implying that persons are modifications of being, that they are not distinct as required for individual freedom.

In reaction to Descartes’ dualism and Spinoza’s monism, Leibniz's (1646 –1716) doctrine of monads offers a pluralism. Both Descartes and Spinoza assumed that extension implies actual size and shape. Leibniz wondered why we cannot assume that all things are compounds or aggregates of simple substances. These substances are not the extended atoms of Democritus or Epicurus. Each simple substance is a monad that is unextended and has no size or shape. Each is a metaphysical point that Leibniz calls souls to emphasize their nonmaterial nature. And, each possesses its own principle of action within itself and behaves according its own created purpose, yet they work together according to God’s preestablished harmony. A person’s identity centers on a dominant monad, his soul, whose life is an “unfolding,” set from the beginning. Since the basic nature of persons is thought, development through life means moving from murky confused ideas to true ones, the way things really are. In this way, Leibniz was the first philosopher to reject the substance of persons and to adopt an agency view, even if deterministic. Some philosophers, such as Leroy E. Leomker (1770-1830), consider Leibniz the first modern personalist, where persons are agents, not substances with an attribute.

Immanuel Kant (1724-1804) and Hegel (1770-1830) exerted major influences on the formation and development of Personalism in the West.  Kant’s distinction between the phenomenal and noumenal world reinforced Berkeley’s view of “material” substance and emphasized that the only path to reality is through the practical reason of persons. With his claim that compliance with moral law is the essence of human dignity and personhood, Kant exerted the single most influence on ethical personalists. That influence was transmitted into American philosophy largely through the work of Hermann Lotze (1817-1881).

Within that background, the modern Personalist vision was first stated in the context of a philosophical issue lying at the core of 18th and 19th century German philosophy. The issue was raised in the debate between the followers of Spinoza and those of Leibniz. For Spinozists, Being is one and independent. If Being were more than one, it would not independent; and, if Being is independent it cannot be many. For Leibnizians, reality is a pluralism of monads. The debate between the two systems sharpened to the debate between monism and pluralism. The problem of the One and the Many resurfaced. How can they be reconciled? What philosophical view can do so? At least two alternatives surfaced at the end of the 18th century and the beginning of the 19th.

The first alternative was Hegel's. According to a recent interpreter, he sought a “‘unification philosophy’ – the need to unify not only life's various and conflicting powers, but especially the opposing human craving – for individuality and finitude, on the one hand, and for the absolute and the infinite, on the other.” (Hegel, 48) Hegel sought it by brilliantly blending the organic growth of an Aristotle and the Absolutism of a Spinoza into a dynamic monistic system marked by idealism, pantheism, and rationalism.

In reaction to the rationalism of Absolute Idealism and to individual realism, a poet and philosopher and older contemporary of Hegel, Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi (1743-1819) offered the second alternative, Personalism. He thought that Personalism is “‘that form of idealism which gives equal recognition to both the pluralistic and monistic aspects of experience and which finds in the conscious unity, identity, and free activity of personality the key to the nature of reality and the solution of the ultimate problems of philosophy.’” (Bengtsson, 53) The insight of Jacobi continued in Schelling, in the Speculative theists (Immanuel Hermann Fichte, Weisse, Ulrici), to Hermann Lotze, the preeminent philosopher in mid-19th century Germany. It was primarily through Lotze that Personalism arrived in Boston. When Personalism arrives in Boston the distinctive modern characteristics of persons are in place: numerically distinct; individual interiority; freedom of choice among genuine options; autonomy; dignity; and agency. As Personalism makes its way to Boston and the West Coast, Personalism on the European continent and in England responds to German Idealism, specifically to Hegel.

In the debate between monism and pluralism, the traditional problem of the One and the Many resurfaces. But more, metaphysical monism and pluralism lie beneath many modern philosophies that Personalism rejects as impersonal, dehumanizing. Absolute idealism leaves little room for free will and self-determination and cannot be reconciled with the worth of the singular person. Totalitarianisms see persons as means to an end that exist for the interests of the state. Personalists respond insisting on self-determination, responsibility, inherent dignity of all persons. Individualism champions the autonomous self as its own law giver, making all other persons a means to one’s own ends. Personalism contends persons are communal, open to, cooperating with, and respecting the viewpoints of others. Personalism also rejects any reduction of persons to impersonal, deterministic laws, whether those of society, for example Auguste Comte (1798-1857), or of nature, Darwinism evolution. Personalists challenge Comtean philosophical positivism and Naturalism whether that of Darwinism or Samuel Alexander (1859-1938) by appealing to the dignity of individual persons, their free will, and values.

On the European continent, responses to Hegel led to the development of three schools: Paris, Gottingen/Freiburg, and Lublin. In Paris and under the influence of Existentialism, Mounier (1905-1950), Marcel (1889-1973), Paul Ricoeur (1913-2005), and Jacques Maritain (1882-1973) developed distinctive types of Personalism. In Gottingen and Feiburg Phenomenology developed under Husserl (1859-1938) who addressed the question of the relation of objective reality and philosophical reflection.  Later he returned to Idealism, precipitating a break with his former students, who, when on their own, made significant contributions to Personalism. These included Max Scheler (1874 – 1928), Dietrich von Hildebrand (1889-1977), Roman Ingarden (1893-1970), and Edith Stein (1891-1942). In Poland, the Catholic University of Lublin is a center of personalist thought whose foremost representative is Karol Wojtyla (1920-2005).  Personalism also developed in Prague at Charles University and under the leadership of Jan Patočka (1907 - 1977), one of Husserl’s last students. In Spain José Ortega y Gasset (1883 – 1955) espoused personalist themes. In Italy, Antonio Pavan of University of Padua ably represents Personalism. Personalism also has its adherents in Scandanavia, such as Jan Olof Bengtsson in Sweden. In Scotland the most notable 19th century personalist was Seth Andrew Pringle-Pattison (1856 – 1931), whose thought influenced William James (1842-1910), George Santayana (1863-1952), and George Herbert Mead (1863-1931). In England, Austin Farrer (1904-1968) argued for a personalist theism. John MacMurray (1891 – 1976) was the most notable Scottish Personalist in the first half of the 20th century. In Russia we find a version of Personalism in Berdyaev’s (1874-1948) thought.

4. North American Personalism

Before the mid-19th century few in North America discussed the thought of German philosophers such as Kant, Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762-1814), Schelling (1775-1854), Hegel, and Lotze. As demands of academic life increased, young American philosophers completed their philosophical preparation with a year or two of study in Germany. When they returned, no longer fully embracing the old Scottish orthodoxy, their thinking was framed by the Spinoza-Leibniz debate, sometimes understood by theologians and many philosophers as the pantheism-individual freedom debate, and by reductions of persons to deterministic laws of society and nature. Deliberating within that framework, they thoroughly discussed the Personalism they learned while studying with Hermann Lotze at Gottingen. Among that group were George Santayana (who wrote his doctoral dissertation at Harvard University on Lotze), William James (1863-1952), Josiah Royce (1855-1916), and Borden Parker Bowne (1847-1910). That conversation grew into what Werkmeister in the mid-20th century calls the “first complete and comprehensive system of philosophy developed in America which has had lasting influence and which still counts some of our outstanding thinkers among its adherents.” (Werkmeister, 103.)

a. Branches of Personalism

Those historical roots found their way into American philosophy and formed at least four distinctive branches of Personalism. These four branches are idealistic (against threat of naturalism and realism), realistic (against reducing all to mind or person), organismic (against idealism, personalistic realism), and ethical (against collectivism and reduction of personality to mechanism and the body-brain).

Idealistic Personalism – The most distinctive type of Personalism in America, excluding Platonism or Kantianism, this idealism is expressed in three different forms: absolutistic, panpsychistic, and personalistic. Influenced by Jamesian pragmatism, Absolutistic idealists contend that reality is quantitatively and qualitatively one absolute mind, spirit, or person. All other beings, including physical and human ones, are ontologically manifestations of the absolute mind. Josiah Royce, William Ernest Hocking (1873-1966), and Mary Whiton Calkins (1863-1929) represented this view. Panpsychists are deeply influenced by Leibniz, who held that God, the supreme monad, creates all other monads and places them in a preestablished harmony. Rejecting absolute idealism, they hold that reality is composed of psychic entities of varying degrees of consciousness. Both A. N. Whitehead (1861-1947) and Charles Hartshorne (1897-2000) can be called, with qualification, panpsychists. Finally, for personalistic idealists, quantitatively, reality is pluralistic, a society of persons; and qualitatively, reality is monistic; it is person. The Infinite Person or God is the ground of all beings and the creator and sustainer of finite persons. In that sense, personalistic idealists are theistic. Representatives of this branch of Personalism include Borden Parker Bowne, Edgar Sheffield Brightman (1884-1953), Peter A. Bertocci (1910-1989), and Leroy Loemker (1900-1985).

Realistic Personalism – These personalists agree with idealistic personalists that Reality is spiritual, mental, and personal. They disagree about the ontological status of the natural order. Nature is neither intrinsically mental nor personal. It is a natural order created by God.  Realistic personalism is most notably expressed by Neo-Scholastics in Europe such as Jacques Maritain (1882-1973), Emmanuel Mounier (1905-1950), and Pope John Paul II (1920-2005), and in America W. Norris Clarke (1915- 2008) and John F. Crosby (1944 -). In America some realistic personalists stand outside the scholastic tradition, notably Georgia Harkness (1891-1974).

Personalistic Organicism – A recent form of Personalism was developed by Frederick Ferre (1933-2013). Rejecting panpsychism and personalistic idealism and influenced by Whitehead’s philosophy of organism, Ferre argues for a personalistic organicism. He claims in Living and Values that persons are “organisms with especially well-developed mental capacities leading to special needs and powers.” (Ferre, Living, 140) By these powers they can “perceive and manipulate the world, can vocalize and socialize, can create language, can imagine and plan by use of symbols freed from the immediate environment, and can guide behavior by ideal norms.” (Ferre, Living, 140)

Ethical Personalism – These personalists stress the crucial role of values in ontology and the moral life. Ethical Personalism is well represented by George Holmes Howison (1834-1916) who focuses on the Ideal or God toward which all uncreated persons move and the standard by which they measure the degree of their individual self-definition. Practically, ethical personalists concentrate on the dignity and value of persons in moral decision making.

b. Major figures

i. Harvard University

Josiah Royce’s thought was motivated by a religious view of life and reality, with an emphasis on the self and community. He sought to realize his philosophical goals through a synthesis of two traditions: the rationalistic system building of philosophers in the West, and the pragmatic emphasis on experience and practice, distinctive of American philosophical activity since the late nineteenth century. Royce also had a long and abiding interest in science and scientific inquiry and was deeply influenced by Charles Sanders Peirce (1839-1914). He wove these strands during his long and productive career.

At the root of Royce’s system is a concept of the self. Early in his career, the Absolute appears as the Self who knows all in one synoptic vision. Rejecting realism, mysticism, and critical rationalism, his central thesis is that to be real is to be a determinate, individual fulfillment of a purpose. Later he focused more on mediation and the idea of system. Toward the end of his career, the self appears as social. He developed a social theory of reality, a community of interpretation. He called this community “the Beloved Community” whose goal was to possess the truth in its totality.

William James, a leading pragmatist, shared with personalists a key insight. James said, “The more perfect and more eternal aspect of the universe is represented in our religions as having personal form. The universe is no longer a mere It to us, but a Thou, if we are religious; and any relation that may be possible from person to person might be possible here.” (William James, 27-28)

Mary Whiton Calkins, a student of Josiah Royce and William James at Harvard, taught psychology, classics, and philosophy at Smith College. Influenced by Royce and James, she adopted a monistic personal idealism and a personalistic psychology. In 1905, Calkins was elected president of the American Psychological Association and in 1918, she was elected president of the American Philosophical Association.

William Ernest Hocking believed the universe is independent of human minds but is discoverable through phenomenology. Sometimes thought of as the American Husserl, he studied for three months with Husserl at Gottingen. Scolded by the Harvard Philosophy Department for wasting his time with an unknown philosopher, he went to Berlin to complete his year abroad.  Yet, Husserl’s phenomenology made a deep impression on Hocking. Through careful phenomenological analysis, Hocking unpacked everyday phenomena and found that “nature can no longer be fully understood from the atoms upward but only from consciousness or selfhood outwardly.” (Howie, “Hocking’s ‘Transfigured Naturalism,’” 219)  Philosophy must be idealistic. Further, values keep emerging as we learn more about the world and ourselves. The mental life has unity, is deep and mysterious, and finally coheres in a single will. The finite person is an imperfect image of the universe. Influenced by personal idealism and Royce’s absolute idealism, the final unity is a self infinite in depth and mystery. The self or person is also a natural thing that is completely determined. More than a natural thing, the self is free to determine what will be fact in the next moment. Though nature and mind are in opposition to each other, one subject to the laws of nature, the other transcending them, through the ceremonies of religion that opposition is overcome.

ii. Boston University

Borden Parker Bowne claimed to be the first personalist in any thoroughgoing sense, having developed a systematic metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, and psychology. He taught at Boston University from 1876 until his death in 1910. Metaphysically Bowne was a pluralistic idealist like Howison. But his theism distinguishes his Personalism from Howison’s. God, the Divine Person, is both creator and world ground. Finite selves are created, and nature is the energizing of the Cosmic Mind. As world ground, the Divine Mind is the “self-directing intelligent agency” that accounts for the order and continuity of the phenomenal world.

Bowne was not only a systematic philosopher but also a caustic critic of Hegel’s absolutism, Spencer’s evolutionism, and all forms of materialism. These criticisms were expressed in his famous chapter in Personalism, “The Failure of Impersonalism.” In addition, any form of dogmatism or fundamentalism was the target of his searing attacks, especially when held by religious leaders in the Methodist Church.

Bowne’s teaching at Boston University attracted many young talented philosophers, some of whom formed the second generation of personalists in America. The most important among them were Albert Knudson (1873-1953), who continued the personalist tradition in the Divinity School of Boston University; Ralph Tyler Flewelling (1871-1960), who developed the School of Philosophy at the University of Southern California; and Edgar Sheffield Brightman, who led the Philosophy Department at Boston University from 1919 until his death in 1953.

Brightman (1884-1953) was the leading exponent in America of Personalist Idealism during the first half of the 20th century CE. Educated at Brown, Brightman earned his doctorate in Philosophy at Boston University under the founder of Personalism in America, Borden Parker Bowne.

Though an ordained Methodist minister and an authority on the Old Testament, for most of his scholarly life his central interests lay in the fields of Ethics, Philosophy of Religion, and Metaphysics.

A creative, brilliant, original philosopher, Brightman, in agreement with other Boston University personalists, sought truth to guide creative living in the most empirically coherent interpretation of experience. Rejecting the skepticism of Descartes, beginning the search for truth within experience, and advancing and testing hypotheses, Brightman developed the distinction between the shining present and the illuminating absent. Pointing beyond itself, the shining present is unintelligible without reference to an illuminating absent. Though the shining present does not prejudice the nature of the illuminating absent, Person is the hypothesis that most coherently illumines the shining present.

Brightman contended that everything that exists [or subsists] is in, of, or for a mind on some level. He defined Personalism as the hypothesis that all being is either a personal experience (a complex unity of consciousness) or some phase or aspect of one or more such experience. Nature is an order generated by the mind of Cosmic Person. Finite persons are created and grounded by the uncreated God, and as such possess free will. Reality is a society of persons.

Brightman’s most impressive work is his Moral Laws, in which he works out, along lines heavily indebted to Hegel, a thoroughgoing ethical theory. In ethics Brightman adopted perfectionism that moved from the abstract universal to the concrete universal. In its moral development, personality should be guided by moral laws, a kind of “regulatory system.” Understood dialectically, “the moral life is a special instance of the relation of the universal to the particular,” wherein the personality can achieve both the best possible and rational freedom. (Deats and Robb, 111) In this way, personality under the guidance of reason, seeks to become the best it can be, a fully integrated personality.

Central to his philosophy of religion is his well-known revision of the traditional view of God. If personality is the basic explanatory model, God must be seen as temporal. As temporal, God is not timeless but omnitemporal. Brightman agrees with the traditional view of God as infinite in goodness, but he disagrees that God is infinite in power. To maintain that God’s power is infinite seriously compromises the goodness of God. If evil is to be taken seriously, the will of God must be understood as limited by the nonrational Given within God’s nature. This nonrational condition in God is neither created nor approved by God, but God maintains constant and growing control of it. This controversial view was debated within personalist circles. For example, L. Harold DeWolf (1905-1906) followed Bowne’s traditional theism rather than Brightman’s, and Peter A. Bertocci (1910-1989) found in Brightman’s revisions a cogent and intelligible theism.

Bertocci, following Brightman as the leading personalist at Boston University, enriched the understanding of person through his work in psychology. Bertocci claims in “Why Personalistic Idealism?” that the person “is a self-identifying, being-becoming agent who maturing and learning as he interacts with the environment, develops a more or less systematic, learned unity of expression and adaptation that we may call his personality.” Bertocci is well known for his view that the essence of person is time. He is best known in the field of philosophy of religion for his wider teleological argument that provided increased evidence for God’s existence.

iii. California

Personalism simultaneously developed in Boston and California. One of the first American philosophers to employ the term Personalism was Howison at the University of California. After graduating from Harvard and early in his career, he was one of the St. Louis Hegelians. A thorough discussion of Hegel, however, led Howison to champion the finite individual and reject the absorption of the individual in the Absolute. In this way, Howison opposes Royce’s absolutism.

Howison succinctly stated his position, quoted by Buckman and Stratton in George Holmes Howison, “All existence is either (1) the existence of minds, or (2) the existence of the items and order of their experience; all the existences known as ‘material’ consisting in certain of these experiences, with an order organized by the self-active forms of consciousness that in their unity constitute the substantial being of a mind, in distinction from its phenomenal life.” Devoted to empiricism, Howison rejected creation. “These many minds . . . have no origin at all – no source in time whatever. There is nothing at all, prior to them, out of which their being arises. . . . They simply are, and together constitute the eternal order.” Collectively they move toward their own fulfillment as measured by the eternal standard to God.

Later at the Univesity of Southern California, Ralph Tyler Flewelling, a student of Bowne’s Personalism, taught Boston University Personalism as enriched into Democratic Personalism. He defined person as “A self-conscious unique unity capable of reflection upon its conscious states, of self-direction and transcending time. The self-identifying subject of experience, possessor of intrinsic values and creative powers. A continuum in a time-space world.” (quoted in Gacka, “American Personalism,” 160; also see R. T. Flewelling, The Person; or The Significance of Man,” 332). Emphasizing personal freedom, dignity, human potential, creativity, intrinsic moral worth, and community, Flewelling promoted Personalistic Democracy. He said, “The only abiding basis for democracy is respect for the sanctity of the person.” This includes respect for those “possibilities which reside in varying degree in every person. . . This means that personality is recognized as an intrinsic value, the most precious possession of society and the greatest source of social ‘advance and welfare.’” (Gacka, 161)

c. African Personalism

African personalists focus on total liberation and empowerment of African Americans, releasing them from oppression, and on the dignity and self-worth, especially lacking among young African American males. The conception of persons and God and the primacy of person are two appealing features of Personalism. Among American African personalists, the best known was Martin Luther King (1929-1968). King translated Personalism into social action by applying it to racism, economic exploitation, and militarism. Following closely its major themes, he emphasized the existence of a personal God, the dignity and sacredness of persons, the existence of an objective moral order and corresponding moral laws, freedom, and moral agency. ” (Burrows, Personalism, 77-78) However, the precedent for King’s social Personalism was set by John Wesley Edward Bowen (1855-1923), a student of Bowne’s, whom Burrows cites in Personalism as the “first African American academic personalist.” Rufus Burrow, Jr. (1951-) argues for a militant Personalism that considers the African American experience. Holding firmly to central personalist themes, he argues in Personalism for the sanctity of the body, the dignity of women, “we-centeredness plus I-centeredness,” preference for the poor and oppressed, immediate and radical social change, and respect for non-human life forms.

Earlier, John Wesley Edward Bowen (1855-1933) became the first African American to earn a Ph.D. degree at Boston University. Devoted to the centrality of person, Bowen argued that the importance of higher education for blacks lay in developing persons into men and women who would occupy important positions in society. Bowen also argued that progress must be intentional and accepted as slow, that social problems must be solved individualistically, and for a “concrete, not abstract ‘brotherhood’ of all persons.” (Burrows, Personalism, 80)

Recently, J. Deotis Roberts (1927-  ), a student of the British personalist Herbert H. Farmer and a black liberation theologian, emphasized that the conscious person is both “the highest intrinsic value and is personal, emphasis on freedom and self-determination, and focus on persons-in-community.” (Burrows, Personalism, 80). His thought can be organized around four personalist principles: the dignity of the whole person, God as personal, freedom and moral agency, and persons-in-community. Blacks are not subhuman, as they have often been treated; they possess intrinsic worth as whole persons and not as minds and bodies. The God of the Bible is personal and loves each of the creatures. Though God is responsible for all that happens in the world, humans are responsible for all moral wrongdoing. Finally, humans can fulfill, develop themselves only in community, which implies “sharing and caring based upon fellow feeling and deep fellowship. Ujamaa, ‘togetherness,’ ‘familyhood,’ is descriptive of community.” (Roberts, quoted by Burrows, Personalism, 85)

Feminists agree with the Personalism of Roberts and other black liberation theologians, but they emphasize the dignity and worth of black women to a degree unknown before. They do so in the context of the four personalist principles mentioned above.

d. American Indian Personalism

Vine Deloria, Jr. (1933 – 2005), a Standing Rock Sioux, exploring the metaphysics of American Indians finds personalistic themes, including a personal universe, dignity and sacredness of life, the existence of a moral order, and moral responsibility.

Every individual, whether a person, a tree, a bison, an alligator, or the sun are fundamental to the world we live in. Never isolated, what they are is constituted by their relationships. Each individual has a personality distinguished by its power and place. Power is the living energy that inhabits the universe, and place is the relationship an individual has to other individuals. More broadly, place is the relationships of things to each other.  In this way, an ear of corn is distinguished from the person who picks it and from the buffalo that provides meat for nourishment and hides for shelter and clothing. Power and place contribute to one’s habitude, “an attitude or awareness of a deep system of experiential relations on which the world is building or living. The key here is recognizing that experience is the undeveloped and untheorized site where the divisions between subjective and objective, material and spiritual, and an entire series of dichotomies disappear.” (Wildcat, “Understanding the Crisis,” in Power and Place, 34). One acquires this through the clan system developed in geographical and ecological environments. For example, the Seminole, living in the wetlands of Florida establish an important relationship the alligator, while the Cherokee, living in the mountains of North Carolina do not. One’s habitude contributes to the richness of one’s personality, to one’s interrelationships with other individuals, and to an understanding of the path one is to walk. Power, place, and habitude suggest that the interrelated universe is alive and personal and must be approached with respect. Living and its quality depend on it.

All relationships have a moral content. Contemplating an action, a person must consider whether the proposed action is appropriate. Harvesting plants involves respecting the plants, their power and place in relationship to other individuals. Considering the impact on others and the consequences of one’s action, one must never intrude into the lives of other. The universe is built upon constructive and cooperative relationships that must be maintained.

Not only must one’s actions correlate with other personalities but also with the larger movements of the universe. They followed the principle that whatever is above must be reflected below. In their villages most tribes constructed their dwellings after some model of the universe. They reproduced the cosmos in miniature and believed that spiritual change would be followed by physical change. In this way, they participated in cosmic rhythms.

Through these relationships humans understand what they are, what they are to be, and what they are to do. Deloria points out that “everything that humans experience has value and instructs in some aspect of life. . . . The real interest of the old Indians was not to discover the abstract structure of physical reality but rather to find the proper road along which for the duration of a person’s life, individuals were supposed to walk. . . . The universe is a moral universe.” (Mankiller, “Foreward,” in Spirit and Reason, vii)

5. Latin American Personalism

Personalism in Latin America developed in the 20th century against the historical background of scholasticism (16th - 19th centuries) and naturalism and positivism (19th century). The contemporary period (late 20th into 21st centuries) continued idealistic and personalistic discussions of axiology and social philosophy, manifested a shyness regarding metaphysics, emphasized existentialist themes, and witnessed the rise of dialectical materialism. The discussion of Personalism chiefly took place in three centers of philosophical activity, Argentina, Mexico, and Puerto Rico.

In Argentina, two philosophers distinguished themselves. Alejandro Korn (1860-1936), in reaction to positivism, introduced German philosophy to his countrymen and was known as “the teacher of knowledge and virtue” and “The Philosopher of Liberty.” Emphasizing the role of intuition as the basis of knowledge and the social idealism, his views were not fully developed.  Franscisco Romero (1891-1962), a younger contemporary of Korn, arriving at his philosophy by way of psychology, was a sworn foe of mechanistic and behaviorist view of persons. Persons are whole, a structure not determined by its parts. They are both of the psyche, the lower, subjective, egotistic aspect of the self; and spirit, the objective and altruistic tendencies of the self. He thought that person is the key to reality. Persons have the ability to transcend subjectivity and grasp a superindividual order, and order that transcends him. Romero thought Josiah Royce’s The World and the Individual as the greatest contribution America has made to systematic and speculative philosophy.

Mexico is the second outstanding center of philosophical activity. Chief among its eminent thinkers is José Vasconcelos (1882-1959). Though critical of idealism and leaning decidedly toward Thomistic realism, he is deeply theistic and personalistic. Holding to a theistic monism, the universe is a living whole that finds its unity in God. His chief themes are individuality, freedom, purposeful creativity, cosmic reality in process, personality, and God. Vasconcelos, unlike most philosophers in North America, was a man of action, standing for the president of Mexico, though never elected. Bergson’s call to philosophers to “think like men of action and act like men of thought” was often heeded in Latin America.

The third center is Puerto Rico, whose most distinguished thinker was Eugenio Maria de Hostos (1839-1903). An ethical and social idealist, Hostos stressed the supreme worth personality, the dignity of persons. That is the foundation stone of civilization itself. No mere ivory tower, idealistic thinker, Hostos gave a realistic analysis of the danger inherent in what he called our “machine civilization.”

In addition to those centers of philosophical activity and their signal figures, other philosophers who discussed personalist themes were Antonio Caso in Mexico (1883-1946), Alejandro Deustua (1849-1945) and Victor Andres Belaunde (1883-1966) in Peru, Enrique Molina in Chile, and Carlos Vas Ferreira (1872-1959) in Uruguay.  Recently, Ignacio Ellacuria (1930-1989) of San Salvador developed Liberation Philosophy that focused on the social and personal imperative to overcome dependency as the path toward the fullness of one’s humanity. Common themes among them include dynamic stress on action, the philosophy of persons, freedom of persons, and the law.

Regarding direct of influence of North American Personalism on Latin American philosophers, when Latin American philosophers became aware of North American philosophy, it was Personalism, especially that of Edgar Sheffield Brightman that attracted them most among then-living philosophers. Josiah Royce also attracted them, especially The World and the Individual, as we have seen. But, it was Brightman’s Personalism that exerted the greatest influence. The interest was reciprocal. Brightman established the first graduate course in Latin American philosophy in the United States. (Cornelius Kruse, 149)

6. Current Trends

Personalists in North America carry on a vibrant philosophical discussion. They are developing, modifying, and challenging concepts and themes central to 20th century Personalism. They include Richard C. Bayer at Fordham University, drawing on Catholic social thought and affirming the dignity of persons, focuses on personal development and a modified market economy. Patrick Grant at University of Victoria, British Columbia, outlines a Personalism approach appropriate for a post-modern and post-Marxist cultural phase. Thomas R. Rourke at Clarion University and Rosita A. Chazarreta Rourke at Duquesne University, heavily influenced by Mounier, Dorothy Day and the Catholic Worker movement,  defend Personalism as an alternative to liberal capitalist and socialism. Erazim Kohak (1933-), drawing on the early work of Edmund Husserl (1859-1938) and Max Scheler (1874-1928), developed a personalistic view of nature. John Howie (1929-2000) developed an environmental ethics along personalist lines. Randall Auxier (1961-), editor of Library of Living Philosophers, writes on Brightman, Hartshorne, Royce, and Whitehead and is rethinking time, a category central to Brightman’s thought. Doug Anderson writes on Pierce and American philosophy. Currently, the center of studies in Personalism is in the department of philosophy of South Illinois University, where it is taught in the American philosophy program. Rufus Burrow, Jr. writes on African Personalism, particularly Martin Luther King, Jr.  Thomas O. Buford founded and edited The Personalist Forum, now The Pluralist, and writes in education, epistemology, American Personalism, and philosophy of culture. Also, he and Charles Conti of University of Sussex Brighton England formed The International Forum on Persons in 1988.  It holds biennial meetings alternating between North American and Europe. Alternating with the international meetings, Jim McLachlin holds a week-long summer conference on Personalism at Western Carolina University in the mountains of North Carolina.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Auxier, Randall E.  Hartshorne and Brightman on God, Process, and Persons: TheCorrespondence, 1922-1945. Nashville, TN: Vanderbilt University Press, 2001.
  • Bengtsson, Jan Olof. The Worldview of Personalism, Origins and Early Development. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006.
  • Bertocci, Peter A.  Introduction to the Philosophy of Religion. New York, NY: Prentice-Hall, Inc., 1951.
  • Bertocci, Peter A, and Richard M. Millard.  Personality and the Good. New York, NY: David McKay, Co., 1963.
  • Blau, Joseph L. Men and Movements in American Philosophy. New York, NY: Prentice-Hall, Inc., 1955.
  • Bertocci, Peter A. "Why Personalistic Idealism?" Idealistic Studies. 10, no. 3 (1980): 181-198.
  • Boethius, Liber de Persona et Duabus Naturis. Rome: Tuguri, 1571.
  • Bowne, Borden Parker.  Metaphysics. New York, NY: Harper and Brothers, 1882.
  • Bowne, Borden Parker.  A Theory of Thought and Knowledge. New York, NY: Harper and Brothers, 1987.
  • Bowne, Borden Parker.  Principles of Ethics.  New York, NY: Harper and Brothers, 1892
  • Bowne, Borden Parker. Personalism. Boston, MA: Houghton Mifflin Company, 1908.
  • Bowne, Borden Parker.  Kant and Spencer, a Critical Exposition. Boston, MA: Houghton Mifflin, 1912.
  • Brightman, Edgar Sheffield. An Introduction to Philosophy. New York, NY: Henry Holt and Co., Inc, 1925.
  • Brightman, Edgar Sheffield.  Moral Laws. New York, NY: Abingdon Press, 1933.
  • Brightman, Edgar Sheffield.  A Philosophy of Religion. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall, Inc., 1940.
  • Brightman, Edgar Sheffield.  Person and Reality. Edited by Peter A. Bertocci with Janette E. Newhall and Robert S. Brightman. New York, NY: Ronald Press, 1958.
  • Buford, Thomas O. Trust, Our Second Nature; Crisis, Reconciliation, and the Personal. Lanham, Maryland: Lexington Books, 2008.
  • Buford, Thomas O. Self-Knowledge, An Essay in Social Personalism. Lanham, Maryland: Lexington Books, 2011.
  • Buford, Thomas O., and Harold H. Oliver, eds. Personalism Revisited, Its Proponentsand Critics. New York, NY: Rodopi, 2002.
  • Buford, Thomas O. In Search of a Calling, The College’s Role in Shaping Identity. Macon, GA: Mercer University Press, 1995.
  • Burrows, Rufus R. Personalism, a Critical Introduction. St. Louis, MO: The Chalice Press, 1999.
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Author Information

Thomas O. Buford
Furman University
U. S. A.

Contemporary Metaphilosophy

What is philosophy? What is philosophy for? How should philosophy be done? These are metaphilosophical questions, metaphilosophy being the study of the nature of philosophy. Contemporary metaphilosophies within the Western philosophical tradition can be divided, rather roughly, according to whether they are associated with (1) Analytic philosophy, (2) Pragmatist philosophy, or (3) Continental philosophy.

The pioneers of the Analytic movement held that philosophy should begin with the analysis of propositions. In the hands of two of those pioneers, Russell and Wittgenstein, such analysis gives a central role to logic and aims at disclosing the deep structure of the world. But Russell and Wittgenstein thought philosophy could say little about ethics. The movement known as Logical Positivism shared the aversion to normative ethics. Nonetheless, the positivists meant to be progressive. As part of that, they intended to eliminate metaphysics. The so-called ordinary language philosophers agreed that philosophy centrally involved the analysis of propositions, but, and this recalls a third Analytic pioneer, namely Moore, their analyses remained at the level of natural language as against logic. The later Wittgenstein has an affinity with ordinary language philosophy. For Wittgenstein had come to hold that philosophy should protect us against dangerous illusions by being a kind of therapy for what normally passes for philosophy. Metaphilosophical views held by later Analytic philosophers include the idea that philosophy can be pursued as a descriptive but not a revisionary metaphysics and that philosophy is continuous with science.

The pragmatists, like those Analytic philosophers who work in practical or applied ethics, believed that philosophy should treat ‘real problems’ (although the pragmatists gave ‘real problems’ a wider scope than the ethicists tend to). The neopragmatist Rorty goes so far as to say the philosopher should fashion her philosophy so as to promote her cultural, social, and political goals. So-called post-Analytic philosophy is much influenced by pragmatism. Like the pragmatists, the post-Analyticals tend (1) to favor a broad construal of the philosophical enterprise and (2) to aim at dissolving rather than solving traditional or narrow philosophical problems.

The first Continental position considered herein is Husserl’s phenomenology. Husserl believed that his phenomenological method would enable philosophy to become a rigorous and foundational science. Still, on Husserl’s conception, philosophy is both a personal affair and something that is vital to realizing the humanitarian hopes of the Enlightenment. Husserl’s existential successors modified his method in various ways and stressed, and refashioned, the ideal of authenticity presented by his writings. Another major Continental tradition, namely Critical Theory, makes of philosophy a contributor to emancipatory social theory; and the version of Critical Theory pursued by Jürgen Habermas includes a call for 'postmetaphysical thinking'. The later thought of Heidegger advocates a postmetaphysical thinking too, albeit a very different one; and Heidegger associates metaphysics with the ills of modernity. Heidegger strongly influenced Derrida’s metaphilosophy. Derrida’s deconstructive approach to philosophy (1) aims at clarifying, and loosening the grip of, the assumptions of previous, metaphysical philosophy, and (2) means to have an ethical and political import.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. Some Pre-Twentieth Century Metaphilosophy
    2. Defining Metaphilosophy
    3. Explicit and Implicit Metaphilosophy
    4. The Classification of Metaphilosophies – and the Treatment that Follows
  2. Analytic Metaphilosophy
    1. The Analytic Pioneers: Russell, the Early Wittgenstein, and Moore
    2. Logical Positivism
    3. Ordinary Language Philosophy and the Later Wittgenstein
    4. Three Revivals
      1. Normative Philosophy including Rawls and Practical Ethics
      2. History of Philosophy
      3. Metaphysics: Strawson, Quine, Kripke
    5. Naturalism including Experimentalism and Its Challenge to Intuitions
  3. Pragmatism, Neopragmatism, and Post-Analytic Philosophy
    1. Pragmatism
    2. Neopragmatism: Rorty
    3. Post-Analytic Philosophy
  4. Continental Metaphilosophy
    1. Phenomenology and Related Currents
      1. Husserl’s Phenomenology
      2. Existential Phenomenology, Hermeneutics, Existentialism
    2. Critical Theory
      1. Critical Theory and the Critique of Instrumental Reason
      2. Habermas
    3. The Later Heidegger
    4. Derrida's Post-Structuralism
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Explicit Metaphilosophy and Works about Philosophical Movements or Traditions
    2. Analytic Philosophy including Wittgenstein, Post-Analytic Philosophy, and Logical Pragmatism
    3. Pragmatism and Neopragmatism
    4. Continental Philosophy
    5. Other

1. Introduction

The main topic of the article is the Western metaphilosophy of the last hundred years or so. But that topic is broached via a sketch of some earlier Western metaphilosophies. (In the case of the sketch, ‘Western’ means European. In the remainder of the article, ‘Western’ means European and North American. On Eastern meta­philosophy, see the entries filed under such heads as ‘Chinese philosophy’ and ‘Indian philosophy’.) Once that sketch is in hand, the article defines the notion of metaphilosophy and distinguishes between explicit and implicit metaphilosophy. Then there is a consideration of how metaphilosophies might be categorized and an outline of the course of the remainder of the article.

a. Some Pre-Twentieth Century Metaphilosophy

Socrates believed that the unexamined life – the unphilosophical life – was not worth living (Plato, Apology, 38a). Indeed, Socrates saw his role as helping to rouse people from unreflective lives. He did this by showing them, through his famous ‘Socratic method’, that in fact they knew little about, for example, justice, beauty, love or piety. Socrates’ use of that method contributed to his being condemned to death by the Athenian state. But Socrates’ politics contributed too; and here one can note that, according to the Republic (473c-d), humanity will prosper only when philosophers are kings or kings’ philosophers. It is notable too that, in Plato’s Phaedo, Socrates presents death as liberation of the soul from the tomb of the body.

According to Aristotle, philosophy begins in wonder, seeks the most fundamental causes or principles of things, and is the least necessary but thereby the most divine of sciences (Metaphysics, book alpha, sections 1–3). Despite the point about necessity, Aristotle taught ethics, a subject he conceived as ‘a kind of political science’ (Nicomachean Ethics, book 1) and which had the aim of making men good. Later philosophers continued and even intensified the stress on philosophical practicality. According to the Hellenistic philosophers – the Cynics, Sceptics, Epicureans and Stoics - philosophy revealed (1) what was valuable and what was not, and (2) how one could achieve the former and protect oneself against longing for the latter. The Roman Cicero held that to study philosophy is to prepare oneself for death. The later and neoplatonic thinker Plotinus asked, ‘What, then, is Philosophy?’ and answered, ‘Philosophy is the supremely precious’ (Enneads, I.3.v): a means to blissful contact with a mystical principle he called ‘the One’.

The idea that philosophy is the handmaiden of theology, earlier propounded by the Hellenistic thinker Philo of Alexandria, is most associated with the medieval age and particularly with Aquinas. Aquinas resumed the project of synthesizing Christianity with Greek philosophy - a project that had been pursued already by various thinkers including Augustine, Anselm, and Boethius. (Boethius was a politician inspired by philosophy – but the politics ended badly for him. In those respects he resembles the earlier Seneca. And, like Seneca, Boethius wrote of the consolations of philosophy.)

‘[T]he word “philosophy” means the study [or love – philo] of wisdom, and by “wisdom” is meant not only prudence in our everyday affairs but also a perfect knowledge of all things that mankind is capable of knowing, both for the conduct of life and for the preservation of health and the discovery of all manner of skills.’ Thus Descartes (1988: p. 179). Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding (bk. 4. ch. 19, p. 697) connects philosophy with the love of truth and identifies the following as an ‘unerring mark’ of that love: ‘The not entertaining any Proposition with greater assurance than the Proofs it is built upon will warrant.’ Hume’s ‘Of Suicide’ opens thus: ‘One considerable advantage that arises from Philosophy, consists in the sovereign antidote which it affords to superstition and false religion’ (Hume 1980: 97). Kant held that ‘What can I know?’, ‘What ought I to do?’, and, ‘What may I hope?’ were the ultimate questions of human reason (Critique of Pure Reason, A805 / B33) and asserted that philosophy’s ‘peculiar dignity’ lies in ‘principles of morality, legislation, and religion’ that it can provide (A318 / B375). According to Hegel, the point of philosophy – or of ‘the dialectic’ – is to enable people to recognize the embodiment of their ideals in their social and political lives and thereby to be at home in the world. Marx’s famous eleventh ‘Thesis on Feuerbach’ declared that, while philosophers had interpreted the world, the point was to change it.

b. Defining Metaphilosophy

As the foregoing sketch begins to suggest, three very general metaphilosophical questions are (1) What is philosophy? (2) What is, or what should be, the point of philosophy? (3) How should one do philosophy? Those questions resolve into a host of more specific meta­philosophical conundra, some of which are as follows. Is philosophy a process or a product? What kind of knowledge can philosophy attain? How should one understand philosophical disagreement? Is philosophy historical in some special or deep way? Should philosophy make us better people? Happier people? Is philosophy political? What method(s) and types of evidence suit philosophy? How should philosophy be written (presuming it should be written at all)? Is philosophy, in some sense, over – or should it be?

But how might one define metaphilosophy? One definition owes to Morris Lazerowitz. (Lazerowitz claims to have invented the English word ‘metaphilosophy’ in 1940. But some foreign-language equivalents of the term ‘metaphilosophy’ antedate 1940. Note further that, in various languages including English, sometimes the term takes a hyphen before the ‘meta’.) Lazerowitz proposed (1970) that metaphilosophy is ‘the investigation of the nature of philosophy.’ If we take ‘nature’ to include both the point of philosophy and how one does (or should do) philosophy, then that definition fits with the most general meta­philosophical questions just identified above. Still: there are other definitions of metaphilosophy; and while Lazerowitz’s definition will prove best for our purposes, one needs – in order to appreciate that fact, and in order to give the definition a suitable (further) gloss – to survey the alternatives.

One alternative definition construes metaphilosophy as the philosophy of philosophy. Sometimes that definition intends this idea: metaphilosophy applies the method(s) of philosophy to philosophy itself. That idea itself comes in two versions. One is a ‘first-order’ construal. The thought here is this. Metaphilosophy, as the application of philosophy to philosophy itself, is simply one more instance of philosophy (Wittgenstein 2001: section 121; Williamson 2007: ix). The other version – the ‘second-order’ version of the idea that metaphilosophy applies philosophy to itself – is as follows. Metaphilosophy stands to philosophy as philosophy stands to its subject matter or to other disciplines (Rescher 2006), such that, as Williamson puts it (loc. cit) metaphilosophy ‘look[s] down upon philosophy from above, or beyond.’ (Williamson himself, who takes the first-order view, prefers the term ‘the philosophy of philosophy’ to ‘metaphilosophy’. For he thinks that ‘metaphilosophy’ has this connotation of looking down.) A different definition of metaphilosophy exploits the fact that ‘meta’ can mean not only about but also after. On this definition, metaphilosophy is post-philosophy. Sometimes Lazerowitz himself used ‘metaphilosophy’ in that way. What he had in mind here, more particularly, is the ‘special kind of investigation which Wittgenstein had described as one of the “heirs” of philosophy’ (Lazerowitz 1970). Some French philosophers have used the term similarly, though with reference to Heidegger and/or Marx rather than to Wittgenstein (Elden 2004: 83).

What then commends Lazerowitz’s (original) definition – the definition whereby metaphilosophy is investigation of the nature (and point) of philosophy? Two things. (1) The two ‘philosophy–of–philosophy’ construals are competing specifications of that definition. Indeed, those construals have little content until after one has a considerable idea of what philosophy is. (2) The equation of metaphilosophy and post-philosophy is narrow and tendentious; but Lazerowitz’s definition accommodates post-philosophy as a position within a more widely construed metaphilosophy. Still: Lazerowitz’s definition does require qualification, since there is a sense in which it is too broad. For ‘investigation of the nature of philosophy’ suggests that any inquiry into philosophy will count as meta­philosophical, whereas an inquiry tends to be deemed meta­philosophical only when it pertains to the essence, or very nature, of philosophy. (Such indeed is a third possible reading of the philosophy-of-philosophy construal.) Now, just what does so pertain is moot; and there is a risk of being too unaccommodating. We might want to deny the title ‘metaphilosophy’ to, say, various sociological studies of philosophy, and even, perhaps, to philosophical pedagogy (that is, to the subject of how philosophy is taught). On the other hand, we are inclined to count as meta­philosophical claims about, for instance, philosophy corrupting its students or about professionalization corrupting philosophy (on these claims one may see Stewart 1995 and Anscombe 1957).

What follows will give a moderately narrow interpretation to the term ‘nature’ within the phrase ‘the nature of philosophy’.

c. Explicit and Implicit Metaphilosophy

Explicit metaphilosophy is metaphilosophy pursued as a subfield of, or attendant field to, philosophy. Metaphilosophy so conceived has waxed and waned. In the early twenty-first century, it has waxed in Europe and in the Anglophone (English-speaking) world. Probable causes of the  increasing interest include Analytic philosophy having become more aware of itself as a tradition, the rise of philosophizing of a more empirical sort, and a softening of the divide between ‘Analytic’ and ‘Continental’ philosophy. (This article will revisit all of those topics in one way or another.) However, even when waxing, metaphilosophy generates much less activity than philosophy. Certainly the philosophical scene contains few book-length pieces of metaphilosophy. Books such as Williamson’s The Philosophy of Philosophy, Rescher’s Essay on Metaphilosophy, and What is Philosophy? by Deleuze and Guattari – these are not the rule but the exception.

There is more to metaphilosophy than explicit metaphilosophy. For there is also implicit metaphilosophy. To appreciate that point, consider, first, that philosophical positions can have meta­philosophical aspects. Many philosophical views – views about, say, knowledge, or language, or authenticity – can have implications for the task or nature of philosophy. Indeed, all philosophizing is somewhat meta­philosophical, at least in this sense: any philosophical view or orientation commits its holder to a metaphilosophy that accommodates it. Thus if one advances an ontology one must have a metaphilosophy that countenances ontology. Similarly, to adopt a method or style is to deem that approach at least passable. Moreover, a conception of the nature and point of philosophy, albeit perhaps an inchoate one, motivates and shapes much philosophy. But – and this is what allows there to be implicit metaphilosophy – sometimes none of this is emphasized, or even appreciated at all, by those who philosophize. Much of the metaphilosophy treated here is implicit, at least in the attenuated sense that its authors give philosophy much more attention than philosophy.

d. The Classification of Metaphilosophies – and the Treatment that Follows

One way of classifying metaphilosophy would be by the aim that a given metaphilosophy attributes to philosophy. Alternatively, one could consider that which is taken as the model for philosophy or for philosophical form. Science? Art? Therapy? Something else? A further alternative is to distinguish metaphilosophies according to whether or not they conceive philosophy as somehow essentially linguistic. Another criterion would be the rejection or adoption or conception of metaphysics (metaphysics being something like the study of' the fundamental nature of reality). And many further classifications are possible.

This article will employ the Analytic–Continental distinction as its most general classificatory schema. Or rather it uses these categories: (1) Analytic philosophy; (2) Continental philosophy; (3) pragmatism, neopragmatism, and post-Analytic philosophy, these being only some of the most important of metaphilosophies of the last century or so. Those metaphilosophies are distinguished from one from another via the philosophies or philosophical movements (movements narrower than those of the three top-level headings) to which they have been conjoined. That approach, and indeed the article's most general schema, means that this account is organized by chronology as much as by theme. One virtue of the approach is that it provides a degree of historical perspective. Another is that the approach helps to disclose some rather implicit metaphilosophy associated with well-known philosophies. But the article will be thematic to a degree because it will bring out some points of identity and difference between various metaphilosophies and will consider criticisms of the metaphilosophies treated. However, the article will not much attempt to determine, on meta­philosophical or other criteria, the respective natures of Analytic philosophy, pragmatism, or Continental philosophy. The article employs those categories solely for organizational purposes. But note the following points.

  1. The particular placing of some individual philosophers within the schema is problematic. The case of the so-called later Wittgenstein is particularly moot. Is he ‘Analytic’? Should he have his own category?
  2. The delineation of the traditions themselves is controversial. The notions of the Analytic and the Continental are particularly vexed. The difficulties here start with the fact that here a geographical category is juxtaposed to a more thematic or doctrinal one (Williams 2003). Moreover, some philosophers deny that Analytic philosophy has any substantial existence (Preston 2007; see also Rorty 1991a: 217); and some assert the same of Continental philosophy (Glendinning 2006: 13 and ff).
  3. Even only within contemporary Western history, there are significant approaches to philosophy that seem to at least somewhat warrant their own categories. Among those approaches are ‘traditionalist philosophy’, which devotes itself to the study of ‘the grand [...] tradition of Western philosophy ranging from the Pre-Socratics to Kant’ (Glock 2008: 85f.), feminism, and environmental philosophy. This article does not examine those approaches.

2. Analytic Metaphilosophy

a. The Analytic Pioneers: Russell, the Early Wittgenstein, and Moore

Bertrand Russell, his pupil Ludwig Wittgenstein, and their colleague G. E. Moore – the pioneers of Analytic philosophy – shared the view that ‘all sound philosophy should begin with an analysis of propositions’ (Russell 1992: 9; first published in 1900). In Russell and Wittgenstein such analysis was centrally a matter of logic. (Note, however, that the expression ‘Analytic philosophy’ seems to have emerged only in the 1930s.)

Russellian analysis has two stages (Beaney 2007: 2–3 and 2009: section 3; Urmson 1956). First, propositions of ordinary or scientific language are transformed into what Russell regarded as their true form. This ‘logical’ or ‘transformative’ analysis draws heavily upon the new logic of Frege and finds its exemplar in Russell’s ‘theory of descriptions’ (Analytic Philosophy, section 2.a). The next step is to correlate elements within the transformed propositions with elements in the world. Commentators have called this second stage or form of analysis – which Russell counted as a matter of ‘philosophical logic’ – ‘reductive’, ‘decompositional’, and ‘metaphysical’. It is decompositional and reductive inasmuch as, like chemical analysis, it seeks to revolve its objects into their simplest elements, such an element being simple in that it itself lacks parts or constituents. The analysis is metaphysical in that it yields a metaphysics. According to the metaphysics that Russell actually derived from his analysis – the metaphysics which he called ‘logical atomism’ – the world comprises indivisible ‘atoms’ that combine, in structures limned by logic, to form the entities of science and everyday life. Russell’s empiricism inclined him to conceive the atoms as mind-independent sense-data. (See further Russell’s Metaphysics, section 4.)

Logic in the dual form of analysis just sketched was the essence of philosophy, according to Russell (2009: ch. 2). Nonetheless, Russell wrote on practical matters, advocating, and campaigning for, liberal and socialist ideas. But he tended to regard such activities as unphilosophical, believing that ethical statements were non-cognitive and hence little amenable to philosophical analysis (see Non-Cognitivism in Ethics). But he did come to hold a form of utilitarianism that allowed ethical statements a kind of truth-aptness. And he did endorse a qualified version of this venerable idea: the contemplation of profound things enlarges the self and fosters happiness. Russell held further that practicing an ethics was little use given contemporary politics, a view informed by worries about the effects of conformity and technocracy. (On all this, see Schultz 1992.)

Wittgenstein agreed with Frege and Russell that ‘the apparent logical form of a proposition need not be its real one’ (Wittgenstein 1961: section 4.0031). And he agreed with Russell that language and the world share a common, ultimately atomistic, form. But Wittgenstein’s Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus developed these ideas into a somewhat Kantian and actually rather Schopenhauerian position. (That book, first published in 1921, is the main and arguably only work of the so-called ‘early Wittgenstein’. section 2.c treats Wittgenstein’s later views.) The Tractatus taught the following. Only when propositions depict possible states of affairs do they have sense. Propositions of science and of everyday language pass that test. Propositions of logic do not quite do so. They have the form necessary for depiction; but they depict nothing because they boil down to either tautologies or contradictions. Hence they are ‘senseless’ (in Wittgenstein’s original German: sinnlos). As to metaphysical statements – statements about, inter alia, the meaning of life and God, and statements of ethics and aesthetics – they are ‘nonsense’ (Unsinn). They try to depict something. But what they try to depict is no possible state of affairs within the world. Wittgenstein concludes that philosophy is ‘a critique of language’ that detects and expunges metaphysical talk (Wittgenstein 1961: section 4.0031). ‘[W]henever someone [...] want[s] to say something metaphysical’, one should ‘demonstrate to him that he had failed to give a meaning to certain signs in his propositions’ (section 6.53). But there is a complication. Wittgenstein (section 6.54–7): ‘anyone who understands me eventually recognizes [my own propositions] as nonsensical, when he has used them–as steps–to climb up beyond them [...] He must transcend these propositions, and then he will see the world aright. What we cannot speak about we must pass over in silence’. Still, Wittgenstein applies the honorifics ‘mystical’ and ‘higher’ (section 6.42–6.522) to his statements about the limits of language and to various other metaphysical statements, including ethical ones. In the case of these (‘mystical’/‘higher’) nonsensical propositions, the point of remaining silent about them is not to damn them but rather to leave their truth unprofaned.

Like Russell and Wittgenstein, Moore advocated a form of decompositional analysis. He held that ‘a thing becomes intelligible first when it is analyzed into its constituent concepts’ (Moore 1899: 182; see further Beaney 2009: section 4). But Moore uses normal language rather than logic to specify those constituents; and, in his hands, analysis often supported commonplace, pre-philosophical beliefs. Nonetheless, and despite confessing that other philosophers rather than the world prompted his philosophizing (Schilpp 1942: 14), Moore held that philosophy should give ‘a general description of the whole Universe’ (1953: 1). Accordingly, Moore tackled ethics and aesthetics as well as epistemology and metaphysics. His Principia Ethica used the not-especially-commonsensical idea that goodness was a simple, indefinable quality in order to defend the meaningfulness of ethical statements and the objectivity of moral value. Additionally, Moore advanced a normative ethic, the wider social or political implications of which are debated (Hutchinson 2001).

Russell’s tendency to exclude ethics from philosophy, and Wittgenstein’s protective version of the exclusion, are contentious and presuppose their respective versions of atomism. In turn, that atomism relies heavily upon the idea, as meta­philosophical as it is philosophical, of an ideal language (or at least of an ideal analysis of natural language). Later sections criticize that idea. Such criticism finds little target in Moore. Yet Moore is a target for those who hold that philosophy should be little concerned with words or even, perhaps, with concepts (see section 2.c and the ‘revivals’ treated in section 2.d).

b. Logical Positivism

We witness the spirit of the scientific world-conception penetrating in growing measure the forms of personal and public life, in education, upbringing, architecture, and the shaping of economic and social life according to rational principles. The scientific world-conception serves life, and life receives it. The task of philosophical work lies in [...] clarification of problems and assertions, not in the propounding of special “philosophical” pronouncements. The method of this clarification is that of logical analysis.

The foregoing passages owe to a manifesto issued by the Vienna Circle (Neurath, Carnap, and Hahn 1973: 317f. and 328). Leading members of that Circle included Moritz Schlick (a physicist turned philosopher), Rudolf Carnap (primarily a logician), and Otto Neurath (economist, sociologist, and philosopher). These thinkers were inspired by the original positivist, Auguste Comte. Other influences included the empiricism(s) of Hume, Russell and Ernst Mach, and the Russell–Wittgenstein idea of an ideal logical language. (The Tractatus, in particular, was a massive influence.) The Circle, in turn, gave rise to an international movement that went under several names: logical positivism, logical empiricism, neopositivism, and simply positivism.

The clarification or logical analysis advocated by positivism is two-sided. Its destructive task was the use of the so-called verifiability principle to eliminate metaphysics. According to that principle, a statement is meaningful only when either true by definition or verifiable through experience. (So there is no synthetic apriori. See Kant, Metaphysics, section 2, and A Priori and A Posteriori.) The positivists placed mathematics and logic within the true-by-definition (or analytic apriori) category, and science and most normal talk in the category of verifiable-through-experience (or synthetic aposteriori). All else was deemed meaningless. That fate befell metaphysical statements and finds its most famous illustration in Carnap’s attack (1931) on Heidegger’s ‘What is Metaphysics?’ It was the fate, too, of ethical and aesthetic statements. Hence the non-cognitivist meta-ethics (see Ethics, section 1) that some positivists developed.

The constructive side of positivistic analysis involved epistemology and philosophy of science. The positivists wanted to know exactly how experience justified empirical knowledge. Sometimes – the positivists took a variety of positions on that question – the idea was to reduce all scientific statements to those of physics. (See Reductionism.) That effort went under the heading of ‘unified science’. So too did an idea that sought to make good on the claim that positivism ‘served life’. That idea was that the sciences should collaborate in order to help solve social problems, a project championed by the so-called Left Vienna Circle and, within that, especially by Neurath (who served in a socialist Munich government and, later, was a central figure in Austrian housing movements). The positivists had close relations with the Bauhaus movement, which was itself understood by its members as socially progressive (Galison 1990).

Positivism had its problems and its detractors. The believer in ‘special philosophical pronouncements’ will think that positivism decapitates philosophy (compare section 4.a below, on Husserl). Moreover, positivism itself seemingly involved at least one ‘special’ – read: metaphysical – pronouncement, namely, the verifiability principle. Further, there is reason to distrust the very idea of providing strict criteria for nonsense (see Glendinning 2001). Further yet, the idea of an ideal logical language was attacked as unachievable, incoherent, and/or – when used as a means to certify philosophical truth – circular (Copi 1949). There were doubts, too, about whether positivism really ‘served life’. (1) Might positivism’s narrow notion of fact prevent it from comprehending the real nature of society? (Critical Theory leveled that objection. See O’Neill and Uebel 2004.) (2) Might positivism involve a disastrous reduction of politics to the discovery of technical solutions to depoliticized ends? (This objection owes again to Critical Theory, but also to others. See Galison 1990 and O’Neill 2003.)

Positivism retained some coherence as a movement or doctrine until the late 1960s, even though the Nazis – with whom the positivists clashed – forced the Circle into exile. In fact, that exile helped to spread the positivist creed. But, not long after the Second World War, the ascendancy that positivism had acquired in Anglophone philosophy began to diminish. It did so partly because of the developments to be considered next.

c. Ordinary Language Philosophy and the Later Wittgenstein

Some accounts group ordinary language philosophy and the philosophy of the later Wittgenstein (and of Wittgenstein’s disciples) together – under the title ‘linguistic philosophy’. That grouping can mislead. All previous Analytic philosophy was centrally concerned with language. In that sense, all previous Analytic philosophy had taken the so-called ‘linguistic turn’ (see Rorty 1992). Nevertheless, ordinary language philosophy and the later Wittgenstein do mark a change. They twist the linguistic turn away from logical or constructed languages and towards ordinary (that is, vernacular) language, or at least towards natural (non-artificial) language. Thereby the new bodies of thought represent a movement away from Russell, the early Wittgenstein, and the positivists (and back, to an extent, towards Moore). In short – and as many accounts of the history of Analytic philosophy put it – we have here a shift from ideal language philosophy to ordinary language philosophy.

Ordinary language philosophy began with and centrally comprised a loose grouping of philosophers among whom the Oxford dons Gilbert Ryle and J. L. Austin loomed largest. The following view united these philosophers. Patient analysis of the meaning of words can tap the rich distinctions of natural languages and minimize the unclarities, equivocations and conflations to which philosophers are prone. So construed, philosophy is unlike natural science and even, insofar as it avoided systematization, unlike linguistics. The majority of ordinary language philosophers did hold, with Austin, that such analysis was not the ‘the last word’ in philosophy. Specialist knowledge and techniques can in principle everywhere augment and improve it. But natural or ordinary language ‘is the first word’ (Austin 1979: 185; see also Analytic Philosophy, section 4a).

The later Wittgenstein did hold, or at least came close to holding, that ordinary language has the last word in philosophy. This later Wittgenstein retained his earlier view that philosophy was a critique of language – of language that tried to be metaphysical or philosophical. But he abandoned the idea (itself problematically metaphysical) that there was one true form to language. He came to think, instead, that all philosophical problems owe to ‘misinterpretation of our forms of language’ (Wittgenstein 2001: section 111). They owe to misunderstanding of the ways language actually works. A principal cause of such misunderstanding, Wittgenstein thought, is misassimilation of expressions one to another. Such misassimilation can be motivated, in turn, by a ‘craving for generality’ (Wittgenstein 1975: 17ff.) that is inspired by science. The later Wittgenstein’s own philosophizing means to be a kind of therapy for philosophers, a therapy which will liberate them from their problems by showing how, in their very formulations of those problems, their words have ceased to make sense. Wittgenstein tries to show how the words that give philosophers trouble – words such as ‘know’, ‘mind’, and ‘sensation’ – become problematical only when, in philosophers’ hands, they depart from the uses and the contexts that give them meaning. Thus a sense in which philosophy ‘leaves everything as it is’ (2001: section 124). ‘[W]e must do away with all explanation, and description alone must take its place’ (section 124). Still, Wittgenstein himself once asked, ‘[W]hat is the use of studying philosophy if all that it does for you is to enable you to talk with some plausibility about some abstruse questions of logic, etc. [...]’? (cited in Malcolm 1984: 35 and 93). And in one sense Wittgenstein did not want to leave everything as it was. To wit: he wanted to end the worship of science. For the view that science could express all genuine truths was, he held, barbarizing us by impoverishing our understanding of the world and of ourselves.

Much meta­philosophical flack has been aimed at the later Wittgenstein and ordinary language philosophy. They have been accused of: abolishing practical philosophy; rendering philosophy uncritical; trivializing philosophy by making it a mere matter of words; enshrining the ignorance of common speech; and, in Wittgenstein’s case – and in his own words (taken out of context) – of ‘destroy[ing] everything interesting’ (2001: section 118; on these criticisms see Russell 1995: ch. 18, Marcuse 1991: ch. 7 and Gellner 2005). Nonetheless, it is at least arguable that these movements of thought permanently changed Analytic philosophy by making it more sensitive to linguistic nuance and to the oddities of philosophical language. Moreover, some contemporary philosophers have defended more or less Wittgensteinian conceptions of philosophy. One such philosopher is Peter Strawson (on whom see section 2.d.iii). Another is Stanley Cavell. Note also that some writers have attempted to develop the more practical side of Wittgenstein’s thought (Pitkin 1993, Cavell 1979).

d. Three Revivals

Between the 1950s and the 1970s, there were three significant, and persisting, meta­philosophical developments within the Analytic tradition.

i. Normative Philosophy including Rawls and Practical Ethics

During positivism’s ascendancy, and for some time thereafter, substantive normative issues – questions about how one should live, what sort of government is best or legitimate, and so on – were widely deemed quasi-philosophical. Positivism’s non-cognitivism was a major cause. So was the distrust, in the later Wittgenstein and in ordinary language philosophy, of philosophical theorizing. This neglect of the normative had its exceptions. But the real change occurred with the appearance, in 1971, of A Theory of Justice by John Rawls.

Many took Rawls' book to show, through its ‘systematicity and clarity’, that normative theory was possible ‘without loss of rigor’ (Weithman 2003: 6). Rawls' procedure for justifying normative principles is of particular metaphilosophical note. That procedure, called ‘reflective equilibrium’, has three steps. (The quotations that follow are from Schroeter 2004.)

  1. ‘[W]e elicit the moral judgments of competent moral judges’ on whatever topic is at issue. (In Theories of Justice itself, distributive justice was the topic.) Thereby we obtain ‘a set of considered judgments, in which we have strong confidence’.
  2. ‘[W]e construct a scheme of explicit principles, which will ‘‘explicate’’, ‘‘fit’’, ‘‘match’’ or ‘‘account for’’ the set of considered judgments.’
  3. By moving ‘back and forth between the initial judgments and the principles, making the adjustments which seem the most plausible’, ‘we remove any discrepancy which might remain between the judgments derived from the scheme of principles and the initial considered judgments’, thereby achieving ‘a point of equilibrium, where principles and judgments coincide’.

The conception of reflective equilibrium was perhaps less philosophically orthodox than most readers of Theory of Justice believed. For Rawls came to argue that his conception of justice was, or should be construed as, ‘political not metaphysical’ (Rawls 1999b: 47–72). A political conception of justice ‘stays on the surface, philosophically speaking’ (Rawls 1999b: 395). It appeals only to that which ‘given our history and the traditions embedded in our public life [...] is the most reasonable doctrine for us’ (p. 307). A metaphysical conception of justice appeals to something beyond such contingencies. However: despite advocating the political conception, Rawls appeals to an ‘overlapping consensus’ (his term) of metaphysical doctrines. The idea here, or hope, is this (Rawls, section 3; Freeman 2007: 324–415). Citizens in modern democracies hold various and not fully inter-compatible political and social ideas. But those citizens will be able to unite in supporting a liberal conception of justice.

Around the same time as Theory of Justice appeared, a parallel revival in normative philosophy begun. This was the rise of practical ethics. Here is how one prominent practical ethicist presents ‘the most plausible explanation’ for that development. ‘[L]aw, ethics, and many of the professions—including medicine, business, engineering, and scientific research—were profoundly and permanently affected by issues and concerns in the wider society regarding individual liberties, social equality, and various forms of abuse and injustice that date from the late 1950s’ (Beauchamp 2002: 133f.). Now the new ethicists, who insisted that philosophy should treat ‘real problems’ (Beauchamp 2002: 134), did something largely foreign to previous Analytic philosophy (and to that extent did not, in fact, constitute a revival). They applied moral theory to such concrete and pressing matters as racism, sexual equality, abortion, governance and war. (On those problems, see Ethics, section 3).

According to some practical ethicists, moral principles are not only applied to, but also drawn from, cases. The issue here – the relation between theory and its application – broadened out into a more thoroughly metaphilosophical debate. For, soon after Analytic philosophers had returned to normative ethics, some of them rejected a prevalent conception of normative ethical theory, and others entirely rejected such theory. The first camp rejects moral theory qua ‘decision procedure for moral reasoning’ (Williams 1981: ix-x) but does not foreclose other types of normative theory such as virtue ethics. The second and more radical camp holds that the moral world is too complex for any (prescriptive) codification that warrants the name ‘theory’. (On these positions, see Lance and Little 2006, Clarke 1987, Chappell 2009.)

ii. History of Philosophy

For a long time, most analytic philosophers held that the history of philosophy had little to do with doing philosophy. For what – they asked - was the history of philosophy save, largely, a series of mistakes? We might learn from those mistakes, and the history might contain some occasional insights. But (the line of thought continues) we should be wary of resurrecting the mistakes and beware the archive fever that leads to the idea that there is no such thing as philosophical progress. But in the 1970s a more positive attitude to the history of philosophy began to emerge, together with an attempt to reinstate or re-legitimate serious historical scholarship within philosophy (compare Analytic Philosophy section 5.c).

The newly positive attitude towards the history of philosophy was premised on the view that the study of past philosophies was of significant philosophical value. Reasons adduced for that view include the following (Sorell and Rogers 2005). History of philosophy can disclose our assumptions. It can show the strengths of positions that we find uncongenial. It can suggest rolesthat philosophy might take today by revealing ways in which philosophy has been embedded in a wider intellectual and sociocultural frameworks. A more radical view, espoused by Charles Taylor (1984: 17) is that, ‘Philosophy and the history of philosophy are one’; ‘we cannot do the first without also doing the second.’

Many Analytical philosophers continue to regard the study of philosophy’s history as very much secondary to philosophy itself. By contrast, many so-called Continental philosophers take the foregoing ideas, including the more radical view – which is associated with Hegel – as axiomatic. (See much of section 4, below.)

iii. Metaphysics: Strawson, Quine, Kripke

Positivism, the later Wittgenstein, and Ordinary Language Philosophy suppressed Analytic metaphysics. Yet it recovered, thanks especially to three figures, beginning with Peter Strawson.

Strawson had his origins in the ordinary language tradition and he declares a large debt or affinity to Wittgenstein (Strawson 2003: 12). But he is indebted, also, to Kant; and, with Strawson, ordinary language philosophy became more systematic and more ambitious. However, Strawson retained an element of what one might call, in Rae Langton’s phrase, Kantian humility. In order to understand these characterizations, one needs to appreciate that which Strawson advocated under the heading of ‘descriptive metaphysics’. In turn, descriptive metaphysics is best approached via that which Strawson called ‘connective analysis’.

Connective analysis seeks to elucidate concepts by discerning their interconnections, which is to say, the ways in which concepts variously imply, presuppose, and exclude one another. Strawson contrasts this ‘connective model’ with ‘the reductive or atomistic model’ that aims ‘to dismantle or reduce the concepts we examine to other and simpler concepts’ (all Strawson 1991: 21). The latter model is that of Russell, the Tractatus, and, indeed, Moore. Another way in which Strawson departs from Russell and the Tractatus, but not from Moore, lies in this: a principal method of connective analysis is ‘close examination of the actual use of words’ (Strawson 1959: 9). But when Strawson turns to ‘descriptive metaphysics’, such examination is not enough.

Descriptive metaphysics is, or proceeds via, a very general form of connective analysis. The goal here is ‘to lay bare the most general features of our conceptual structure’ (Strawson 1959: 9). Those most general features – our most general concepts – have a special importance. For those concepts, or at least those of them in which Strawson is most interested, are (he thinks) basic or fundamental in the following sense. They are (1) irreducible, (2) unchangeable in that they comprise ‘a massive central core of human thinking which has no history’ (1959: 10) and (3) necessary to ‘any conception of experience which we can make intelligible to ourselves’ (Strawson 1991: 26). And the structure that these concepts comprise ‘does not readily display itself on the surface of language, but lies submerged’ (1956: 9f.).

Descriptive metaphysics is considerably Kantian (see Kant, metaphysics). Strawson is Kantian, too, in rejecting what he calls ‘revisionary metaphysics’. Here we have the element of Kantian ‘humility’ within Strawson’s enterprise. Descriptive metaphysics ‘is content to describe the actual structure of our thought about the world’, whereas revisionary metaphysics aims ‘to produce a better structure’ (Strawson 1959: 9; my stress). Strawson urges several points against revisionary metaphysics.

  1. A revisionary metaphysic is apt to be an overgeneralization of some particular aspect of our conceptual scheme and/or
  2. to be a confusion between conceptions of how things really are with some Weltanschauung.
  3. Revisionary metaphysics attempts the impossible, namely, to depart from the fundamental features of our conceptual scheme. The first point shows the influence of Wittgenstein. So does the third, although it is also (as Strawson may have recognized) somewhat Heideggerian. The second point is reminiscent of Carnap’s version of logical positivism. All this notwithstanding, and consistently enough, Strawson held that systems of revisionary metaphysics can, through the ‘partial vision’ (1959: 9) that they provide, be useful to descriptive metaphysics.

Here are some worries about Strawson’s metaphilosophy. ‘[T]he conceptual system with which “we” are operating may be much more changing, relative, and culturally limited than Strawson assumes it to be’ (Burtt 1963: 35). Next: Strawson imparts very little about the method(s) of descriptive metaphysics (although one might try to discern techniques – in which imagination seems to play a central role – from his actual analyses). More serious is that Strawson imparts little by way of answer to the following questions. ‘What is a concept? How are concepts individuated? What is a conceptual scheme? How are conceptual schemes individuated? What is the relation between a language and a conceptual scheme?’ (Haack 1979: 366f.). Further: why believe that the analytic philosopher has no business providing ‘new and revealing vision[s]’ (Strawson 1992: 2)? At any rate, Strawson helped those philosophers who rejected reductive (especially Russellian and positivistic) versions of analysis but who wanted to continue to call themselves ‘analytic’. For he gave them a reasonably narrow conception of analysis to which they could adhere (Beaney 2009: section 8; compare Glock 2008: 159). Finally note that, despite his criticisms of Strawson, the contemporary philosopher Peter Hacker defends a metaphilosophy rather similar to descriptive metaphysics (Hacker 2003 and 2007).

William Van Orman Quine was a second prime mover in the metaphysical revival. Quine’s metaphysics, which is revisionary in Strawson’s terms, emerged from Quine’s attack upon ‘two dogmas of modern empiricism’. Those ostensible dogmas are: (1) ‘belief in some fundamental cleavage between truths that are analytic, or grounded in meanings independently of matters of fact, and truths that are synthetic, or grounded in fact’; (2) ‘reductionism: the belief that each meaningful statement is equivalent to some logical construction upon terms which refer to immediate experience’ (Quine 1980: 20). Against 1, Quine argues that every belief has some connection to experience. Against 2, he argues that the connection is never direct. For when experience clashes with some belief, which belief(s) must be changed is underdetermined. Beliefs ‘face the tribunal of sense experience not individually but as a corporate body’ (p. 41; see Evidence section 3.c.i). Quine expresses this holistic and radically empiricist conception by speaking of ‘the web of belief’. Some beliefs – those near the ‘edge of the web’ – are more exposed to experience than others; but the interlinking of beliefs is such that no belief is immune to experience.

Quine saves metaphysics from positivism. More judiciously put: Quine’s conception, if correct, saves metaphysics from the verifiability criterion (q.v. section 2.b). For the notion of the web of belief implies that ontological beliefs – beliefs about ‘the most general traits of reality’ (Quine 1960: 161) – are answerable to experience. And, if that is so, then ontological beliefs differ from other beliefs only in their generality. Quine infers that, ‘Ontological questions [...] are on a par with questions of natural science’ (1980: 45). In fact, since Quine thinks that natural science, and in particular physics, is the best way of fitting our beliefs to reality, he infers that ontology should be determined by the best available comprehensive scientific theory. In that sense, metaphysics is ‘the metaphysics of science’ (Glock 2003a: 30).

Is the metaphysics of science actually only science? Quine asserts that ‘it is only within science itself, and not in some prior philosophy, that reality is to be identified and described’ (1981: 21). Yet he does leave a job for the philosopher. The philosopher is to translate the best available scientific theory into that which Quine called ‘canonical notation’, namely, ‘the language of modern logic as developed by Frege, Peirce, Russell and others’ (Orenstein 2002: 16). Moreover, the philosopher is to make the translation in such a way as to minimize the theory’s ontological commitments. Only after such a translation, which Quine calls ‘explication’ can one say, at a philosophical level: ‘that is What There Is’. (However, Quine cannot fully capitalize those letters, as it were. For he thinks that there is a pragmatic element to ontology. See section 3.a below.) This role for philosophy is a reduced one. For one thing, it deprives philosophy of something traditionally considered one of its greatest aspirations: necessary truth. On Quine’s conception, no truth can be absolutely necessary. (That holds even for the truths of Quine’s beloved logic, since they, too, fall within the web of belief.) By contrast, even Strawson and the positivists – the latter in the form of ‘analytic truth’ – had countenanced versions of necessary truth.

Saul Kripke - the third important reviver of metaphysics - allows the philosopher a role that is perhaps slightly more distinct than Quine does. Kripke does that precisely by propounding a new notion of necessity. (That said, some identify Ruth Barcan Marcus as the discoverer of the necessity at issue.) According to Kripke (1980), a truth T about X is necessary just when T holds in all possible worlds that contain X. To explain: science shows us that, for example, water is composed of H20; the philosophical question is whether that truth holds of all possible worlds (all possible worlds in which water exists) and is thereby necessary. Any such science-derived necessities are aposteriori just because, and in the sense that, they are (partially) derived from science.

Aposteriori necessity is a controversial idea. Kripke realizes this. But he asks why it is controversial. The notions of the apriori and aposteriori are epistemological (they are about whether or not one needs to investigate the world in order to know something), whereas – Kripke points out – his notion of necessity is ontological (that is, about whether things could be otherwise). As to how one determines whether a truth obtains in all possible worlds, Kripke’s main appeal is to the intuitions of philosophers. The next subsection somewhat scrutinizes that appeal, together with some of the other ideas of this subsection.

e. Naturalism including Experimentalism and Its Challenge to Intuitions

Kripke and especially Quine helped to create, particularly in the United States, a new orthodoxy within Analytic philosophy. That orthodoxy is naturalism or - the term used by its detractors - scientism. But naturalism (/scientism) is no one thing (Glock 2003a: 46; compare Papineau 2009). Ontological naturalism holds that the entities treated by natural science exhaust reality. Meta­philosophical naturalism – which is the focus in what follows – asserts a strong continuity between philosophy and science. A common construal of that continuity runs thus. Philosophical problems are in one way or another ‘tractable through the methods of the empirical sciences’ (Naturalism, Introduction). Now, within meta­philosophical naturalism, one can distinguish empirical philosophers from experimental philosophers (Prinz 2008). Empirical philosophers enlist science to answer, or to help answer, philosophical problems. Experimental philosophers (or ‘experimentalists’) themselves do science, or do so in collaboration with scientists. Let us start with empirical philosophy.

Quine is an empirical philosopher in his approach to metaphysics and even more so in his approach to epistemology. Quine presents and urges his epistemology thus: ‘The stimulation of his sensory receptors is all the evidence anybody has had to go on, ultimately, in arriving at his picture of the world. Why not just see how this construction really proceeds? Why not settle for psychology?’ (Quine 1977: 75). Such naturalistic epistemology – in Quine’s own formulation, ‘naturalized epistemology’ – has been extended to moral epistemology. ‘A naturalized moral epistemology is simply a naturalized epistemology that concerns itself with moral knowledge’ (Campbell and Hunter 2000: 1). There is such a thing, too, as naturalized aesthetics: the attempt to use science to solve aesthetical problems (McMahon 2007). Other forms of empirical philosophy include neurophilosophy, which applies methods from neuroscience, and sometimes computer science, to questions in the philosophy of mind.

Naturalized epistemology has been criticized for being insufficiently normative. How can descriptions of epistemic mechanisms determine license for belief? The difficulty seems especially pressing in the case of moral epistemology. Wittgenstein’s complaint against naturalistic aesthetics – a view he called ‘exceedingly stupid’ – may intend a similar point. ‘The sort of explanation one is looking for when one is puzzled by an aesthetic impression is not a causal explanation, not one corroborated by experience or by statistics as to how people react’ (all Wittgenstein 1966: 17, 21). A wider disquiet about meta­philosophical naturalism is this: it presupposes a controversial view explicitly endorsed by Quine, namely that science alone provides true or good knowledge (Glock 2003a: 28, 46). For that reason and for others, some philosophers, including Wittgenstein, are suspicious even of scientifically-informed philosophy of mind.

Now the experimentalists – the philosophers who actually do science – tend to use science not to propose new philosophical ideas or theories but rather to investigate existing philosophical claims. The philosophical claims at issue are based upon intuitions, intuitions being something like ‘seemings’ or spontaneous judgments. Sometimes philosophers have employed intuitions in support of empirical claims. For example, some ethicists have asserted, from their philosophical armchairs, that character is the most significant determinant of action. Another example: some philosophers have speculated that most people are ‘incompatibilists’ about determinism. (The claim in this second example is, though empirical, construable as a certain type of second-order intuition, namely, as a claim that is empirical, yet made from the armchair, about the intuitions that other people have.) Experimentalists have put such hunches to the test, often concluding that they are mistaken (see Levin 2009 and Levy 2009). At other times, though, the type of intuitively-based claim that experimentalists investigate is non-empirical or at least not evidently empirical. Here one finds, for instance, intuitions about what counts as knowledge, about whether some feature of something is necessary to it (recall Kripke, above), about what the best resolution of a moral dilemma is, and about whether or not we have free will. Now, experimentalists have not quite tested claims of this second sort. But they have used empirical methods in interrogating the ways in which philosophers, in considering such claims, have employed intuitions. Analytic philosophers have been wont to use their intuitions about such non-empirical matters to establish burdens of proof, to support premises, and to serve as data against which to test philosophical theories. But experimentalists have claimed to find that, at least in the case of non-philosophers, intuitions about such matters vary considerably. (See for instance Weinberg, Nichols and Stitch 2001.) So, why privilege the intuitions of some particular philosopher?

Armchair philosophers have offered various responses. One is that philosophers’ intuitions diverge from ‘folk’ intuitions only in this way: the former are more considered versions of the latter (Levin 2009). But might not such considered intuitions vary among themselves? Moreover: why at all trust even considered intuitions? Why not think – with Quine (and William James, Richard Rorty, Nietzsche, and others) that intuitions are sedimentations of culturally or biologically inherited views? A traditional response to that last question (an ‘ordinary language response’ and equally, perhaps, ‘an ideal language’ response) runs as follows. Intuitions do not convey views of the world. Rather they convey an implicit knowledge of concepts or of language. A variation upon that reply gives it a more naturalistic gloss. The idea here is that (considered) intuitions, though indeed ‘synthetic’ and, as such, defeasible, represent good prima facie evidence for the philosophical views at issue, at least if those views are about the nature of concepts (see for instance Graham and Horgan 1994).

3. Pragmatism, Neopragmatism, and Post-Analytic Philosophy

a. Pragmatism

The original or classical pragmatists are the North Americans C.S. Peirce (1839–1914), William James (1842–1910), John Dewey (1859–1952) and, perhaps, G. H. Mead. The metaphilosophy of pragmatism unfolds from that which became known as ‘the pragmatic maxim’.

Peirce invented the pragmatic maxim as a tool for clarifying ideas. His best known formulation of the maxim runs thus: ‘Consider what effects, which might conceivably have practical bearings, we conceive the object of our conception to have. Then, our conception of these effects is the whole of our conception of the object’ (Peirce 1931-58, volume 5: section 402). Sometimes the maxim reveals an idea to have no meaning. Such was the result, Peirce thought, of applying the maxim to transubstantiation, and, indeed, to many metaphysical ideas. Dewey deployed the maxim similarly. He saw it ‘as a method for inoculating ourselves against certain blind alleys in philosophy’ (Talisse and Aikin 2008: 17). James construed the maxim differently. Whereas Peirce seemed to hold that the ‘effects’ at issue were, solely, effects upon sensory experience, James extended those effects into the psychological effects of believing in the idea(s) in question. Moreover, whereas Peirce construed the maxim as a conception of meaning, James turned it into a conception of truth. ‘“The true”’ is that which, ‘in almost any fashion’, but ‘in the long run and on the whole’, is ‘expedient in the way of our thinking’ (James 1995: 86). As a consequence of these moves, James thought that many philosophical disputes were resolvable, and were only resolvable, through the pragmatic maxim.

None of the pragmatists opposed metaphysics as such or as a whole. That may be because each of them held that philosophy is not fundamentally different to other inquiries. Each of Peirce, James and Dewey elaborates the notion of inquiry, and the relative distinctiveness of philosophy, in his own way. But there is common ground on two views. (1) Inquiry is a matter of coping. Dewey, and to an extent James, understand inquiry as an organism trying to cope with its environment. Indeed Dewey was considerably influenced by Darwin. (2) Experimental science is the exemplar of inquiry. One finds this second idea in Dewey but also and especially in Peirce. The idea is that experimental science is the best method or model of inquiry, be the inquiry practical or theoretical, descriptive or normative, philosophical or non-philosophical. ‘Pragmatism as attitude represents what Mr. Peirce has happily termed the “laboratory habit of mind” extended into every area where inquiry may fruitfully be carried on’ (Dewey 1998, volume 2: 378). Each of these views (that is, both 1 and 2) may be called naturalistic (the second being a version of metaphilosophical naturalism; q.v. section 2.e).

According to pragmatism (though Peirce is perhaps an exception) pragmatism was a humanism. Its purpose was to serve humanity. Here is James (1995: 2): ‘no one of us can get along without the far-flashing beams of light it sends over the world’s perspectives’, the ‘it’ here being pragmatist philosophy and also philosophy in general. James held further that pragmatism, this time in contrast with some other philosophies, allows the universe to appear as ‘a place in which human thoughts, choices, and aspirations count for something’ (Gallie 1952: 24). As to Dewey, he held the following. ‘Ideals and values must be evaluated with respect to their social consequences, either as inhibitors or as valuable instruments for social progress’; and ‘philosophy, because of the breadth of its concern and its critical approach, can play a crucial role in this evaluation’ (Dewey, section 4). Indeed, according to Dewey, philosophy is to be ‘a social hope reduced to a working programme of action, a prophecy of the future, but one disciplined by serious thought and knowledge’ (Dewey 1998, vol. 1: 72). Dewey himself pursued such a programme, and not only in his writing – in which he championed a pervasive form of democracy – but also (and to help enable such democracy) as an educationalist.

Humanism notwithstanding, pragmatism was not hostile to religion. Dewey could endorse religion as a means of articulating our highest values. James tended to hold that the truth of religious ideas was to be determined, at the broadest level, in the same way as the truth of anything else. Peirce, for his part, was a more traditional philosophical theist. The conceptions of religion advocated by James and Dewey have been criticized for being very much reconceptions (Talisse and Aikin 2008: 90–94). A broader objection to pragmatist humanism is that its making of man the measure of all things is false and even pernicious. One finds versions of that objection in Heidegger and Critical Theory. One could level the charge, too, from the perspective of environmental ethics. Rather differently, and even more broadly, one might think that ‘moral and political ambitions’ have no place ‘within philosophy proper’ (Glock 2003a: 22 glossing Quine). Objections of a more specific kind have targeted the pragmatic maxim. Critics have faulted Peirce’s version of the pragmatic maxim for being too narrow or too indeterminate; and Russell and others have criticized James' version as a misanalysis of what we mean by ‘true’.

Pragmatism was superseded (most notably in the United States) or occluded (in those places where it took little hold in the first place) by logical positivism. But the metaphilosophy of logical positivism has important similarities to pragmatism’s. Positivism’s verifiability principle is very similar to Peirce’s maxim. The positivists held that science is the exemplar of inquiry. And the positivists, like pragmatism, aimed at the betterment of society. Note also that positivism itself dissolved partly because its original tenets underwent a ‘“pragmaticization”’ (Rorty 1991b: xviii). That pragmaticization was the work especially of Quine and Davidson, who are ‘logical pragmatists’ in that they use logical techniques to develop some of the main ideas of pragmatists (Glock 2003a: 22–3; see also Rynin 1956). The ideas at issue include epistemological holism and the underdetermination of various type of theory by evidence. The latter is the aforementioned (section 2.d.iii) pragmatic element within Quine’s approach to ontology (on which see further Quine’s Philosophy of Science, section 3).

b. Neopragmatism: Rorty

The label ‘neopragmatism’ has been applied to Robert Brandom, Susan Haack, Nicholas Rescher, Richard Rorty, and other thinkers who, like them, identify themselves with some part(s) of classical pragmatism. (Karl-Otto Apel, Jürgen Habermas, John McDowell, and Hilary Putnam are borderline cases; each takes much from pragmatism but is wary about ‘pragmatist’ as a self-description.) This section concentrates upon the best known, most controversial, and possibly the most meta­philosophical, of the neopragmatists: Rorty.

Much of Rorty’s meta­philosophy issues from his antirepresentationalism. Antirepresentationalism is, in the first instance, this view: no representation (linguistic or mental conception) corresponds to reality in a way that exceeds our commonsensical and scientific notions of what it is to get the world right. Rorty’s arguments against the sort of privileged representations that are at issue here terminate or summarize as follows. ‘[N]othing counts as justification unless by reference to what we already accept [...] [T]here is no way to get outside our beliefs and our language so as to find some test other than coherence’ (Rorty 1980: 178). Rorty infers that ‘the notion of “representation,” or that of “fact of the matter,”’ has no ‘useful role in philosophy’ (Rorty 1991b: 2). We are to conceive ourselves, or our conceptions, not as answerable to the world, but only to our fellows (see McDowell 2000: 110).

Rorty thinks that antirepresentationalism entails the rejection of a metaphilosophy which goes back to the Greeks, found a classic expression in Kant, and which is pursued in Analytic philosophy. That metaphilosophy, which Rorty calls ‘epistemological’, presents philosophy as ‘a tribunal of pure reason, upholding or denying the claims of the rest of culture’ (Rorty 1980: 4). More fully: philosophy judges discourses, be they religious, scientific, moral, political, aesthetical or metaphysical, by seeing which of them, and to what degree, disclose reality as it really is. (Clearly, though, more needs to be said if this conception is to accommodate Kant’s ‘transcendental idealism’. See Kant: Metaphysics, section 4.)

Rorty wants the philosopher to be, not a ‘cultural overseer’ adjudicating types of truth claims, but an ‘informed dilettante’ and a ‘Socratic intermediary’ (Rorty 1980: 317). That is, the philosopher is to elicit ‘agreement, or, at least, exciting and fruitful disagreement’ (Rorty 1980: 318) between or within various types or areas of discourse. Philosophy so conceived Rorty calls ‘hermeneutics’. The Rortian philosopher does not seek some schema allowing two or more discourses to be translated perfectly one to the other (an idea Rorty associates with representationalism). Instead she inhabits hermeneutic circle. ‘[W]e play back and forth between guesses about how to characterize particular statements or other events, and guesses about the point of the whole situation, until gradually we feel at ease with what was hitherto strange’ (1980: 319). Rorty connects this procedure to the ‘edification’ that consists in ‘finding new, better, more interesting, more fruitful ways of speaking’ (p. 360) and, thereby, to a goal he calls ‘existentialist’: the goal of finding new types of self-conception and, in that manner, finding new ways to be.

Rorty’s elaboration of all this introduces further notable meta­philosophical views. First: ‘Blake is as much of a philosopher Fichte and Henry Adams more of a philosopher than Frege’ (Rorty 1991a: xv). For Sellars was right, Rorty believes, to define philosophy as ‘an attempt to see how things, in the broadest possible sense of the term, hang together, in the broadest possible sense of the term’ (Sellars 1963: 1; compare section 6, Sellars’ Philosophy of Mind; presumably, though, Rorty holds that one has good philosophy when such attempts prove ‘edifying’). Second: what counts as a philosophical problem is contingent, and not just in that people only discover certain philosophical problems at certain times. Third: philosophical argument, at least when it aspires to be conclusive, requires shared assumptions; where there are no or few shared assumptions, such argument is impossible.

The last of the foregoing ideas is important for what one might call Rorty’s practical metaphilosophy. Rorty maintains that one can argue about morals and/or politics only with someone with whom one shares some assumptions. The neutral ground that philosophy has sought for debates with staunch egoists and unbending totalitarians is a fantasy. All the philosopher can do, besides point that out, is to create a conception that articulates, but does not strictly support, his or her moral or political vision. The philosopher ought to be ‘putting politics first and tailoring a philosophy to suit’ (Rorty 1991b: 178) – and similarly for morality. Rorty thinks that no less a political philosopher than John Rawls has already come close to this stance (Rorty 1991b: 191). Nor does Rorty bemoan any of this. The ‘cultural politics’ which suggests ‘changes in the vocabularies deployed in moral and political deliberation’ (Rorty 2007: ix) is more useful than the attempt to find philosophical foundations for some such vocabulary. The term ‘cultural politics’ could mislead, though. Rorty does not advocate an exclusive concentration on cultural as against social or economic issues. He deplores the sort of philosophy or cultural or literary theory that makes it ‘almost impossible to clamber back down [...] to a level [...] on which one might discuss the merits of a law, a treaty, a candidate, or a political strategy’ (Rorty 2007: 93).

Rorty’s metaphilosophy, and the philosophical views with which it is intertwined, have been attacked as irrationalist, self-refuting, relativist, unduly ethnocentric, complacent, anti-progressive, and even as insincere. Even Rorty’s self-identification with the pragmatist tradition has been challenged (despite the existence of at least some clear continuities). So have his readings, or appropriations, of his philosophical heroes, who include not only James and Dewey but also Wittgenstein, Heidegger and, to a lesser extent, Davidson and Derrida. For a sample of all these criticisms, see Brandom 2000 (which includes replies by Rorty) and Talisse and Aikin 2008: 140–148.

c. Post-Analytic Philosophy

‘Post-Analytic philosophy’ is a vaguely-defined term for something that is a current rather than a group or school. The term (in use as early as Rajchman and West 1985) denotes the work of philosophers who owe much to Analytic philosophy but who think that they have made some significant departure from it. Often the departures in question are motivated by pragmatist allegiance or influence. (Hence the placing of this section.) The following are all considerably pragmatist and are all counted as post-Analytic philosophers: Richard Rorty; Hilary Putnam; Robert Brandom; John McDowell. Still, those same figures exhibit, also, a turn to Hegel (a turn rendered slightly less remarkable by Hegel’s influence upon Peirce and especially upon Dewey). Some Wittgensteinians count as post-Analytic too, as might the later Wittgenstein himself. Stanley Cavell stands out here, though in one way or another Wittgenstein strongly influenced most of philosophers mentioned in this paragraph. Another common characteristic of those deemed post-Analytic is interest in a range of ‘Continental’ thinkers. Rorty looms large here. But there is also the aforementioned interest in Hegel, and, for instance, the fact that one finds McDowell citing Gadamer.

Post-Analytic philosophy is associated with various more or less meta­philosophical views. One is the rejection or severe revision of any notion of philosophical analysis. Witness Rorty, Brandom’s self-styled ‘analytic pragmatism’, and perhaps, meta­philosophical naturalism (q.v. section 2.e). (Still: only rarely – as in Graham and Horgan 1994, who advocate what they call ‘Post-Analytic Metaphilosophy’ – do naturalists call themselves ‘post-Analytic’.) Some post-Analytic philosophers go further, in that they tend, often under the influence of Wittgenstein, to attempt less to solve and more to dissolve or even discard philosophical problems. Each of Putnam, McDowell and Rorty has his own version of this approach, and each singles out for dissolution the problem of how mind or language relates to the world. A third characteristic feature of post-Analytic philosophy is the rejection of a certain kind of narrow professionalism. That sort of professionalism is preoccupied with specialized problems and tends to be indifferent to broader social and cultural questions. One finds a break from such narrow professionalism in Cavell, in Rorty, in Bernard Williams, and to an extent in Putnam (although also in such "public" Analytic philosophers as A. C. Grayling).

Moreover, innovative or heterodox style is something of a criterion of post-Analytic philosophy. One thinks here especially of Cavell. But one might mention McDowell too. Now, one critic of McDowell faults him for putting ‘barriers of jargon, convolution, and metaphor before the reader hardly less formidable than those characteristically erected by his German luminaries’ (Wright 2002: 157). The criticism betokens the way in post-Analytic philosophers are often regarded, namely as apostates. Post-Analytic philosophers tend to defend themselves by arguing either that Analytic philosophy needs to reconnect itself with the rest of culture, and/or that Analytic philosophy has itself shown the untenability of some of its most central assumptions and even perhaps ‘come to the end of its own project—the dead end’ (Putnam 1985: 28).

4. Continental Metaphilosophy

a. Phenomenology and Related Currents

i. Husserl’s Phenomenology

Phenomenology, as pursued by Edmund Husserl describes phenomena. Phenomena are things in the manner in which they appear. That definition becomes more appreciable through the technique through which Husserl means to gain access to phenomena. Husserl calls that technique the epoche (a term that owes to Ancient Greek skepticism). He designates the perspective that it achieves – the perspective that presents one with ‘phenomena’ – ‘the phenomenological reduction’. The epoche consists in suspending ‘the natural attitude’ (another term of Husserl’s coinage). The natural attitude comprises assumptions about the causes, the composition, and indeed the very existence of that which one experiences. The epoche, Husserl says, temporarily ‘brackets’ these assumptions, or puts them ‘out of play’ – allowing one to describe the world solely in the manner in which it appears. That description is phenomenology.

Phenomenology means to have epistemological and ontological import. Husserl presents the epistemological import – to begin with that – in a provocative way: ‘If “positivism” is tantamount to an absolutely unprejudiced grounding of all sciences on the “positive,” that is to say, on what can be seized upon originaliter, then we are the genuine positivists’ (Husserl 1931:  20). The idea that Husserl shares with the positivists is that experience is the sole source of knowledge. Hence Husserl’s ‘principle of all principles’: ‘whatever presents itself in “intuition” in primordial form [...] is simply to be accepted as it gives itself out to be, but obviously only within the limits in which it thus presents itself’ (Husserl 1931: section 24). However, and like various other philosophers (including William James and the German Idealists), Husserl thinks that experience extends beyond what empiricism makes of it. For one thing – and this reveals phenomenology’s intended ontological import – experience can be of essences. A technique of ‘imaginative variation’ similar to Descartes' procedure with the wax (see Descartes, section 4) allows one to distinguish that which is essential to a phenomenon and, thereby, to make discoveries about the nature of such phenomena as numbers and material things. Now, one might think that this attempt to derive essences from phenomena (from things in the manner in which they appear) must be idealist. Indeed – and despite the fact that he used the phrase ‘to the things themselves!’ as his slogan – Husserl did avow a ‘transcendental idealism’, whereby ‘transcendental subjectivity [...] constitutes sense and being’ (Husserl 1999: section 41). However, the exact content of that idealism – i.e. the exact meaning of the phrase just quoted – is a matter of some interpretative difficulty. It is evident enough, though, that Husserl's idealism involves (at least) the following ideas. Experience necessarily involves various ‘subjective achievements’. Those achievements comprise various operations that Husserl calls ‘syntheses’ and which one might (although here one encounters difficulties) call 'mental'. Moreover, the achievements are attributable to a subjectivity that deserves the name 'transcendental' in that (1) the achievements are necessary conditions for our experience, (2) the subjectivity at issue is transcendent in this sense: it exists outside the natural world (and, hence, cannot entirely be identified with what we normally construe as the mind). (On the notion of the transcendental, see further Kant’s transcendental idealism and transcendental arguments.)

Husserl argued that the denial of transcendental subjectivity ‘decapitates philosophy’ (Husserl 1970: 9). He calls such philosophy ‘objectivism’ and asserts that it confines itself to the ‘universe of mere facts’ and allies itself with the sciences. (Thus Husserl employs ‘positivism’ and ‘naturalism’ as terms with similar import to ‘objectivism’.) But objectivism cannot even understand science itself, according to Husserl; for science, he maintains, presupposes the achievements of transcendental subjectivity. Further, objectivism can make little sense of the human mind, of humanity’s place within nature, and of values. These latter failings contribute to a perceived meaninglessness to life and a ‘fall into hostility toward the spirit and into barbarity’ (Husserl 1970: 9). Consequently, and because serious investigation of science, mind, our place in nature, and of values belongs to Europe’s very raison d’être, objectivism helps to cause nothing less than a ‘crisis of European humanity’ (Husserl 1970: 299). There is even some suggestion (in the same text) that objectivism prevents us from experiencing people as people: as more than mere things.

The foregoing shows that phenomenology has a normative aspect. Husserl did make a start upon a systematic moral philosophy. But phenomenology is intrinsically ethical (D. Smith 2003: 4–6), in that the phenomenologist eschews prejudice and seeks to divine matters for him- or herself.

ii. Existential Phenomenology, Hermeneutics, Existentialism

Husserl hoped to found a unified and collaborative movement. His hope was partially fulfilled. Heidegger, Sartre and Merleau-Ponty count as heirs to Husserl because (or mainly because) they believed in the philosophical primacy of description of experience. Moreover, many of the themes of post-Husserlian phenomenology are present already, one way or other, in Husserl. But there are considerable, and indeed meta­philosophical, differences between Husserl and his successors. The meta­philosophical differences can be unfolded from this: Heidegger, Sartre and Merleau-Ponty adhere to an ‘existential’ phenomenology. ‘Existential phenomenology’ has two senses. Each construal matters meta­philosophically.

In one sense, ‘existential phenomenology’ denotes phenomenology that departs from Husserl’s self-proclaimed ‘pure’ or ‘transcendental’ phenomenology. At issue here is this view of Husserl’s: it is logically possible that a consciousness could survive the annihilation of everything else (Husserl 1999: section 13). Existential phenomenologists deny the view. For they accept a kind of externalism whereby experience, or the self, is what it is – and not just causally – by dint of the world that is experienced. (On externalism, see Philosophy of Language, section 4a and Mental Causation, section 3.b.ii.) Various slogans and terms within the work existential phenomenologists express these views. Heidegger’s Being and Time presents the human mode of being as ‘being-in-the-world’ and speaks not of ‘the subject’ or ‘consciousness’ but of ‘Da-sein’ (‘existence’ or, more literally, ‘being-there’). Merleau-Ponty asserts that we are ‘through and through compounded of relationships with the world’, ‘destined to the world’ (2002: xi–xv). In Being and Nothingness, Sartre ‘parenthesiz[es] the word “of” when referring, say, to “consciousness (of) a table” [in order] to reject the “reificatory” idea of consciousness as some thing or container distinct from the world in the midst of which we are conscious’ (Cooper 1999: 201).

Existential phenomenology, so construed, has meta­philosophical import because it affects philosophical (phenomenological) method. Being and Nothingness holds that the inseparability of consciousness from the objects of consciousness ruins Husserl’s method of epoche (Sartre 1989: part one, chapter one; Cerbone 2006: 1989). Merleau-Ponty may not go as far. His Phenomenology of Perception has it that, because we are ‘destined to the world’, ‘The most important lesson of the reduction is the impossibility of a complete reduction’ (2002: xv). But the interpretation of this remark is debated (see J Smith 2005). At any rate – though this is one of the things that an interpreter of his stance on the reduction has to reckon with – Merleau-Ponty found a greater philosophical use for the empirical sciences than did Husserl. Heidegger was more inclined to keep the sciences in their place. But he too – partly because of his existential (externalist) conception of phenomenology – differed from Husserl on the epoche. Again, however, Heidegger’s precise position is hard to discern. (Caputo 1977 describes the interpretative problem and tries to solve it.) Still, Heidegger’s principal innovation in philosophical method has little to do with the epoche. This article considers that innovation before turning to the other sense of existential phenomenology.

Heidegger’s revisions of phenomenological method place him within the hermeneutic tradition. Hermeneutics is the art or practice of interpretation. The hermeneutic tradition (sometimes just called ‘hermeneutics’) is a tradition that gives great philosophical weight to an interpretative mode of understanding. Members of this tradition include Friedrich Schleiermacher (1768–1834), Wilhelm Dilthey (1833–1911) and, after Heidegger, Hans-Georg Gadamer (1900–2002) and Paul Ricœur. Heidegger is hermeneutical in that he holds the following. All understanding is interpretative in that it always has preconceptions. One has genuine understanding insofar as one has worked through the relevant preconceptions. One starts ‘with a preliminary, general view of something; this general view can guide us to insights, which then lead – should lead – to a revised general view, and so on’ (Polt 1999: 98). This ‘hermeneutic circle’ has a special import for phenomenology. For (according to Heidegger) our initial understanding of our relations to the world involves some particularly misleading and stubborn preconceptions, some of which derive from philosophical tradition. Heidegger concludes that what is necessary is ‘a destruction—a critical process in which the traditional concepts, which at first must necessarily be employed, are deconstructed down to the [experiential, phenomenological] sources from which they were drawn’ (Heidegger 1988: 22f.). But Heidegger’s position may be insufficiently, or inconsistently, hermeneutical. The thought is that Heidegger’s own views entail a thesis that, subsequently, Gadamer propounded explicitly. Namely: ‘The very idea of a definitive interpretation [of anything] seems to be intrinsically contradictory’ (Gadamer 1981: 105). This thesis, which Gadamer reaches by conceiving understanding as inherently historical and linguistic, bodes badly for Heidegger’s aspiration to provide definitive ontological answers (an aspiration that he possessed at least as much as Husserl did). Yet arguably (compare Mulhall 1996: 192–5) that very result gels with another of Heidegger’s goals, namely, to help his readers to achieve authenticity (on which more momentarily).

The second meaning or construal of ‘existential phenomenology’ is existentialism. Gabriel Marcel invented that latter term for ideas held by Sartre and by Simone de Beauvoir. Subsequently, Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, Camus, Karl Jaspers, Kafka, and others, got placed under the label. A term used so broadly is hard to define precisely. But the following five theses each have a good claim to be called ‘existentialist’. Indeed: each of the major existential phenomenologists held some version of at least most of the theses (although, while Sartre came to accept the label ‘existentialist’, Heidegger did not).

  1. One’s life determines ever anew the person that one is.
  2. One is free to determine one’s life and, hence, one’s identity.
  3. There is no objective moral order that can determine one’s values. One encounters values within the world (indeed, one encounters them bound up with facts); but nothing rationally compels decision between values.
  4. 1–3 perturb. Hence a tendency towards the inauthenticity (Heidegger’s term) or bad faith (Sartre’s term) which consists in the denial or refusal of those points – often by letting society determine one’s values and/or identity.
  5. The relation to one’s death – as well as to certain types of anxiety and absurdity or groundlessness – is important for disclosing possibilities of authentic existence.

These theses indicate that for the existentialist philosophy must be practical. It is not, though, that existentialism puts ethics at the heart of philosophy. That is because a further central existentialist idea is that no-one, even in principle, can legislate values for another. True, Sartre declared freedom to be ‘the foundation of all values’ (Sartre 2007: 61); and he wrote Notebooks for an Ethics. According to the ethic in question, to will one’s own freedom is to will the freedom of others. But in no further way does that ethic make much claim to objectivity. Instead, much of it turns upon the ‘good faith’ that consists in not denying the fact of one’s freedom.

What of politics? Little in Husserl fits a conventional understanding of political philosophy. Sartre came to hold that his existential ethics made sense only for a society that had been emancipated by Marxism (Sartre 1963: xxv-xxvi). Merleau-Ponty developed a phenomenologically informed political philosophy – and disagreed with Sartre on concrete political questions and on the manner in which the philosopher should be ‘engaged’ (Diprose and Reynolds: ch. 8; Carmen and Hansen 2005: ch. 12). Sartre and Merleau-Ponty give one to think, also, about the idea of artistic presentations of philosophy (Diprose and Reynolds: ch.s 9 and 18). What of Heidegger? He was, of course, a Nazi, although for how long – how long after he led the ‘Nazification’ of Freiburg University – is debated, as is the relation between his Nazism and his philosophy (Wolin 1993; Young 1997; see also section 4.c below). Now the ‘Heidegger case’ raises, or makes more urgent, some general meta­philosophical issues. Should philosophers get involved in politics? And was Gilbert Ryle right to say - as allegedly, apropos Heidegger, he did say (Cohen 2002: 337 n. 21), - that ‘a shit from the heels up can’t do good philosophy’?

The foregoing material indicates a sense in which phenomenology is its own best critic. Indeed, some reactions against phenomenology and existentialism as such – against the whole or broad conception of philosophy embodied they represent – owe to apostates or to heterodox philosophers within those camps. We saw that, in effect, Sartre came to think that existentialism was insufficient for politics. In fact, he came to hold this: ‘Every philosophy is practical, even the one which at first sight appears to be the most contemplative [. . . Every philosophy is] a social and political weapon’ (Sartre 1960: 5). Levinas accused phenomenologists prior to himself of ignoring an absolutely fundamental ethical dimension to experience (see Davis 1996). Derrida resembles Sartre and Levinas, in that, like them, he developed his own metaphilosophy (treated below) largely via internal criticism of phenomenology. Another objection to phenomenology is that it collapses philosophy into psychology or anthropology. (Husserl himself criticized Heidegger in that way.) Rather differently, some philosophers hold that, despite its attitude to naturalism, phenomenology needs to be naturalized (Petitot et al 1999). As to existentialism, it has been criticized for ruining ethics and for propounding an outlook that is not only an intellectual mistake but also – and Heidegger is taken as the prime exhibit – politically dangerous (see Adorno 1986 and ch. 8 of Wolin).

b. Critical Theory

‘Critical Theory’ names the so-called Frankfurt School - the tradition associated with the Institute of Social Research (Institutfürsozialforschung) which was founded in Frankfurt in 1924. (See Literary Theory section 1 for a wider or less historical notion of Critical Theory.) According to Critical Theory, the point of philosophy is that it can contribute to a critical and emancipatory social theory. The specification of that idea depends upon which Critical Theory is at issue; Critical Theory is an extended and somewhat diverse tradition. Its first generation included Theodor Adorno, Max Horkheimer and Herbert Marcuse. Most of the members of this generation had Jewish backgrounds. For that reason, and because the Institute was Marxist, the first generation fled the Nazis. The Institute re-opened in Frankfurt in 1950. Within the second generation, the most prominent figures are Jürgen Habermas and Albrecht Wellmer. Within the third, Axel Honneth is the best known. There is a fourth generation too. Moreover, there were stages or phases within the first generation (Dubiel 1985). To wit: ‘materialism’, 1930–1937; ‘Critical Theory’, 1937–1940; ‘critique of instrumental reason’, 1940–1945; and a proto-stage wherein Critical Theory was more traditionally Marxist than it was subsequently. What follows can consider only some of these versions of Critical Theory.

i. Critical Theory and the Critique of Instrumental Reason

The term ‘the critical theory of society’ (‘Critical Theory’ for short) was introduced only in 1937. It was introduced by Horkheimer, who was director of the Institute at the time. He introduced it partly from prudence. By 1937 the Institute was in the United States, wherein it was unwise for the Institute to call itself Marxist or even to continue to call itself ‘materialist’. But prudence was not the only motive for the new name. Horkheimer meant to clarify and shape the enterprise he was leading. According to Horkheimer (1947), Critical Theory is social theory that is, first of all, broad. It treats society as a whole or in all its aspects. That breadth, together with the idea that society is more independent of the economy than traditional Marxism recognizes, means that Critical Theory must be interdisciplinary. (The expertise of the first-generation encompassed economics, sociology, law, politics, psychology, aesthetics and philosophy.) Next, Critical Theory is emancipatory. It aims at a society that is rational and free and which meets the needs of all. It is to that end that Critical Theory is critical. It means to reveal how contemporary capitalist society, in its economy and its culture and in their interplay, deceives and dominates.

Critical Theory so defined involves philosophy in several ways. (1) From its inception, it adapted philosophical ideas, especially from German Idealism, in order to analyze society. Nonetheless, and following Lukács, (2) Critical Theory thought that some parts of some philosophies could be understood as unknowing reflection of social conditions. (3) Philosophy tends to enter not as the normative underpinning of the theory but in justification for the lack of such underpinning. Horkheimer and company little specified the rational society they sought and little defended the norms by which they indicted contemporary society. With Marx, they held that one should not legislate for what should be the free creation of the future. With Hegel, they held that, anyway, knowledge is conditioned by its time and place. They held also, and again in Hegelian fashion, that there are norms that exist (largely unactualized) within capitalism – norms of justice and freedom and so forth – which suffice to indict capitalism. (4) Critical Theory conceives itself as philosophy’s inheritor. Philosophy, especially post-Kantian German Idealism, had tried to overcome various types of alienation. But only the achievement of a truly free society could actually do that, according to Critical Theory. Note lastly here that, at least after 1936, Critical Theory denied both that ostensibly Marxist regimes were such and that emancipation was anywhere nearly at hand. Consequently, this stage of Critical Theory tended to aim less at revolution and more at propagating awareness of the faults of capitalism and (to a lesser extent) of ‘actually existing socialism’.

There is a sense in which philosophy looms larger (or even larger) in the next phase of the first generation of Critical Theory. For this phase of the moment propounded that which we might call (with a nod to Lyotard) a (very!) grand narrative. Adorno and Horkheimer are the principle figures of this phase, and their co-authored Dialectic of Enlightenment its main text. That text connects enlightenment to that which Max Weber had called ‘the disenchantment of the world’. To disenchant the world is to render it calculable. The Dialectic traces disenchantment from the historical Enlightenment back to the proto-rationality of myth and forward to modern industrial capitalism (to its economy, psychology, society, politics, and even to its philosophies). Weber thought that disenchantment had yielded a world wherein individuals were trapped within an ‘iron cage’ (his term) of economy and bureaucracy. Here is the parallel idea in the Dialectic. Enlightenment has reverted to myth, in that the calculated world of contemporary capitalism is ruled, as the mythic world was ruled, by impersonal and brutish forces. Further analysis in the Dialectic introduces ‘instrumental reason’. That term owes to Horkheimer’s Eclipse of Reason, which is something of a popularization of the Dialectic. The Dialectic itself speaks of ‘subjective reason’. Disenchantment produces a merely instrumental reason in that it pushes choice among ends outside of the purview of rationality. That said, the result – Horkheimer and Adorno argue – is a kind of instrumentalization of ends. Ends get replaced, as a kind of default, by things previously regarded merely instrumentally. Thus, at least or especially by the time of contemporary capitalism, life comes to be governed by such means-become-ends as profit, technical expertise, systematization, distraction, and self-preservation.

Do these ideas really amount to Critical Theory? Perhaps they are too abstract to count as interdisciplinary. Worse: they might seem to exclude any orientation towards emancipation. True, commentators show that Adorno offered more practical guidance than was previously thought. Also, first-generation Critical Theory, including the critique of instrumental reason, did inspire the 1960s student movement. However: while Marcuse responded to that movement with some enthusiasm, Adorno and Horkheimer did not. Perhaps they could not. For though they fix their hopes upon reason (upon ‘enlightenment thinking’), they indict that very same thing. They write (2002: xvi):

We have no doubt—and herein lies our petitio principii—that freedom in society is inseparable from enlightenment thinking. We believe we have perceived with equal clarity, however, that the very concept of that thinking, no less than the concrete historical forms, the institutions of society with which it is intertwined, already contains the germ of the regression.

ii. Habermas

Habermas is a principal source of the criticisms of Adorno and Horkheimer just presented. (He expresses the last of those criticisms by speaking of a ‘performative contradiction’.) Nonetheless, or exactly because he thinks that his predecessors have failed to make good upon the conception, Habermas pursues Critical Theory as Horkheimer defined it, which is to say, as broad, interdisciplinary, critical, and emancipatory social theory.

Habermas' Critical Theory comprises, at least centrally, his ‘critique of functionalist reason’, which is a reworking of his predecessors’ critique of instrumental reason. The central thesis of the critique of functionalist reason is that the system has colonized the lifeworld. In order to understand the thesis, one needs to understand not only the notions of system, lifeworld, and colonization but also the notion of communicative action and – this being the most philosophical notion of the ensemble – the notion of communicative rationality.

Communicative action is action that issues from communicative rationality. Communicative rationality consists, roughly, in ‘free and open discussion [of some issue] by all relevant persons, with a final decision being dependent upon the strength of better argument, and never upon any form of coercion’ (Edgar 2006: 23). The lifeworld comprises those areas of life that exhibit communicative action (or, we shall see, which could and perhaps should exhibit it). The areas at issue include the family, education, and the public sphere. A system is a social domain wherein action is determined by more or less autonomous or instrumental procedures rather than by communicative rationality. Habermas counts markets and bureaucracies as among the most significant systems. So the thesis that the lifeworld has been colonized by the system is the following claim. The extension of bureaucracy and markets into areas such as the family, education, and the public sphere prevent those spheres from being governed by free and open discussion.

Habermas uses his colonization thesis to explain alienation, social instability, and the impoverishment of democracy. He maintains, further, that even systems cannot function if colonization proceeds beyond a certain point. The thinking runs thus. Part of the way in which systems undermine communicative action is by depleting resources (social, cultural and psychological) necessary for such action. But systems themselves depend upon those resources. (Note that, sometimes, Habermas uses the term ‘lifeworld’ to refer to those resources themselves rather than to a domain that does or could exhibit communicative action.) Still: Habermas makes it relatively clear that the colonization thesis is meant not only as descriptive but also as normative. For consider the following. (1) A ‘critique’ – as in ‘critique of functional reason’ – is, at least in its modern usage, an indictment. (2) Habermas presents the creation of a ‘communicative’ lifeworld as essential to the completion – a completion that he deems desirable – of what he calls ‘the unfinished project of modernity’. (3) Habermas tells us (in his Theory of Communicative Action, which is the central text for the colonization thesis) that he means to provide the normative basis for a critical theory of society.

How far does Habermas warrant the normativity, which is to say, show that colonization is bad? It is hard to be in favour of self-undermining societies. But (some degree of?) alienation might be thought a price worth paying for certain achievements; and not everyone advocates democracy (or at least the same degree or type of it). But Habermas does have the following argument for the badness of colonization. There is ‘a normative content’ within language itself, in that ‘[r]eaching understanding is the inherent telos of human speech’; and/but a colonized lifeworld, which by definition is not a domain of communicative action, thwarts that telos. (Habermas 1992a: 109 and Habermas 1984: 287 respectively.)

The idea that language has a communicative telos is the crux of Habermas’ thought. For it is central both to his philosophy of language (or to his so-called universal pragmatics) and to his ethics. To put the second of those points more accurately: the idea of a communicative telos is central to his respective conceptions of both ethics and morality. Habermas understands morality to be a matter of norms that are mainly norms of justice and which are in all cases universally-binding. Ethics, by contrast, is a matter of values, where those values: express what is good for some individual or some group; have no authority beyond the individual or group concerned; and are trumped by morality when they conflict with it. Habermas has a principle, derived from aforementioned telos, that he applies to both normal norms and ethical values. To wit: a norm or value is acceptable only if all those affected by it could accept it in reasonable – rational and uncoerced – discourse. This principle makes morality and ethics matters not for the philosopher but ‘for the discourse between citizens’ (Habermas 1992a: 158). (For more on Habermas’ moral philosophy – his ‘discourse ethics’, as it is known – and on his political philosophy, and also on the ways in which the various aspects of his thought fit together, see Finlayson 2005. Note, too, that in the twenty-first century Habermas has turned his attention to (1) that which religion can contribute to the public discourse of secular states and (2) bioethics.)

Habermas’ denial that philosophers have special normative privileges is part of his general (meta)­philosophical orientation. He calls that orientation ‘postmetaphysical thinking’. In rejecting metaphysics, Habermas means to reject not only a normative privilege for philosophy but also the idea that philosophy can ‘make claims about the world as a whole’ (Dews 1995: 209). Habermas connects postmetaphysical thinking to something else too. He connects it to his rejection of that which he calls ‘the philosophy of consciousness’. Habermas detects the philosophy of consciousness in Descartes, in German Idealism, and in much other philosophy besides. Seemingly a philosophy counts as a philosophy of consciousness, for Habermas, just in case it holds this: the human subject apprehends the world in an essentially individual and non-linguistic way. To take Habermas’ so-called ‘communicative turn’ is to reject that view; it is to hold, instead, that human apprehension is at root both linguistic and intersubjective. Habermas believes that Wittgenstein, Mead, and others prefigured and even somewhat accomplished this ‘paradigm shift’ (Habermas 1992a: 173, 194).

Habermasian postmetaphysical thinking has been charged both with retaining objectionable metaphysical elements and with abandoning too many of philosophy's aspirations. (The second criticism is most associated with Karl-Otto Apel, who nonetheless has co-operated with Habermas in developing discourse ethics. On the first criticism, see for instance Geuss 1981: 94f.) Habermas has been charged, also, with making Critical Theory uncritical. The idea here is this. In allowing that it is alright for some markets and bureaucracies to be systems, Habermas allows too much. (A related but less meta­philosophical issue, touched on above, is whether Habermas has an adequate normative basis for its social criticisms. This issue is an instance of the so-called normativity problem in Critical Theory, on which see Freyenhagen 2008; Finlayson 2009.)

Here are two further meta­philosophical issues. (1) Is it really tenable or desirable for philosophy to be as intertwined with social science as Critical Theory wishes it to be? (For an affirmative answer, see Geuss 2008.) (2) Intelligibility seems particularly important for any thinker who means ‘to reduce the tension between his own insight and the oppressed humanity in whose service he thinks’ (Horkheimer 1937: 221); but Critical Theory has been criticized as culpably obscure and even as mystificatory (see especially the pieces by Popper and Albert in Adorno et al 1976). Adorno has been the principal target for such criticisms (and Adorno did defend his style; see Joll 2009). Yet Habermas, too, is very hard to interpret. That is partly because this philosopher of communication exhibits an ‘unbelievable compulsion to synthesize’ (Knödler-Bunte in Habermas 1992a: 124), which is to say, to combine seemingly disparate – and arguably incompatible – ideas.

c. The Later Heidegger

‘The later Heidegger’ is the Heidegger of, roughly, the 1940s onwards. (Some differences between ‘the two Heideggers’ will emerge below. But hereafter normally ‘Heidegger’ will mean ‘the later Heidegger’.) Heidegger’s difficult, radical, and influential metaphilosophy holds that: philosophy is metaphysics; metaphysics involves a fundamental mistake; metaphysics is complicit in modernity’s ills; metaphysics is entering into its end; and ‘thinking’ should replace metaphysics/philosophy.

Heidegger’s criterion of metaphysics is the identification of being with beings. Metaphysics seeks something designatable as ‘being’ in that metaphysics seeks a principle or ground of beings. Metaphysics identifies being with beings in that it seeks that ground in something that it itself a being, or a cause, or property, of some being(s). Thus, inter alia, the Idea in Plato, Aristotelian or Cartesian or Lockean ‘substance’, various construals of God, the Leibnizian ‘monad’, Husserlian subjectivity, the Nietzschean ‘will to power’. Philosophy is co-extensive with metaphysics in that all philosophy since Plato involves such a project of grounding.

Now Heidegger himself holds that beings have a dependence upon Being. Yet this Being is ‘not God and not a cosmic ground’ (Heidegger 1994: 234) nor any being or thing whatsoever. This distinction is ‘the ontological difference—the differentiation between being and beings’ (Heidegger 1982: 17). We may put the contention thus: pace metaphysics/philosophy, being (das Sein – sometimes translated ‘Being’, capitalized) is non-ontic. But what, then, is being? It may be that Heidegger employs ‘das Sein’ in two senses (Young 2002: ch. 1, Philipse 1998: section 13b; compare for instance Caputo 1993: 30). (1) Being is that by dint of which beings are ‘revealed’ or ‘unconcealed’, that through which they ‘come to presence’ at all and in the particular ways they do. (All these terms are Heidegger’s, or rather translations of his terms.) So being is some sort of condition for beings – but not an ontic one. (2) Being is that which ‘sends’ or ‘destines’ being in sense 1. It is that from which beings are revealed, the ‘reservoir of the non-yet-uncovered, the un-uncovered’ (Heidegger 1971: 60). The (Young–Philipse) device of using uncapitalized ‘being’ for the first sense of das Sein and capitalized ‘Being’ for the other is adopted here. (Where both senses are in play, this article resorts sometimes to the German das Sein. Note, however, that this distinction between two senses of Heideggerian Sein is interpretatively controversial.)

In trying to understand the notion of being (uncapitalized), it helps to recall a view that persists into Heidegger’s later work from his earlier phenomenological period. ‘[P]erception is always the perception of a meaningful being’; ‘everything we encounter appears as a specific kind of thing’ (Braver 2009: 84). In trying to understand the notion of Being, it helps to note that Heidegger means to stress the following point (a point that perhaps reverses a tendency in the early Heidegger). Humanity does not wholly determine how beings are ‘unconcealed’. Nevertheless, it may be a mistake to seek an exact specification of the ideas at issue. For Heidegger may not really mean das Sein (in either sense) to explain anything. He may mean instead to stress the mysteriousness of the fact that beings are accessible to us in the form that they are and, indeed, at all.

Heidegger does posit ‘epochs’ of being, which is to say, a historical series of ontological regimes (and here lies another difference between the earlier and the later Heidegger). The series runs thus: (1) the ancient Greek understanding of being, with which Heidegger associates the word ‘physis’; (2) the Medieval Christian understanding of being, whereby beings (except God and artifacts) are divinely created things; (3) the modern understanding of being as resource (on which more below). However, sometimes Heidegger correlates epochs to a long list of metaphysical systems. Thus the idea of a ‘history of being as metaphysics’ (Heidegger 2003: 65). That history, like the simpler tripartite scheme, does not mean to be a history merely of conceptions of being. It means to be also a history of ontological conceptions themselves. But Heidegger holds that each metaphysic ‘absolutizes’ its corresponding ontological regime (Young 2002: 29, 54, 68). Each metaphysic overlooks the fact that at other times – in other epochs – beings could be ‘unconcealed’ in other ways.

Heidegger allows also for some ontological heterogeneity within epochs. Here one encounters Heidegger’s notion of ‘the thing’ (das Ding). Trees, hills, animals, jugs, bridges, and pictures can be Things in the emphatic sense at issue, but such Things are ‘modest in number, compared with the countless objects’. A Thing has ‘a worlding being’. It opens a world by ‘gathering’ the fourfold (das Geviert). The fourfold is a unity of ‘earth and sky, divinities and mortals’. (All Heidegger 1971: 179ff.). Some of this conception is actually fairly straightforward. Heidegger tries to show how a bridge can be so interwoven with human life and thereby with other entities that, via the ‘world’ that comprises those interrelations (a world not identical with any particular being), there is a co-determination of identity between the Thing (the bridge), persons, and numerous other phenomena.

But in modernity ontological variety diminishes. In modernity Things become mere objects. Subsequently, indeed, objects themselves – together with human beings – become mere resources. To be a resource (or standing-reserve; Bestand) is something that, unlike an object, is determined wholly by a network of purposes into which we place it. Heidegger’s examples are a hydroelectric powerplant on the Rhine and an airplane, together with the electricity and fuel systems to which those artifacts are connected. Heidegger associates resources with modern science and with ‘the metaphysics of subjectivity’ within which (he argues) modern science moves. That metaphysics, which tends towards seeing man as the measure of all things, is in fact metaphysics as such. For anthropocentrism is incipient in the very beginnings of philosophy, blossoms in various later philosophers including Descartes and Kant, and reaches its apogee in Nietzsche, the extremity of whose anthropocentrism is the end of metaphysics (pleonastically: the metaphysics of subjectivity) in the sense of its completion or full unfolding. That end reflects the reign of resources. ‘[T]he world of completed metaphysics can be stringently called “technology”’ (Heidegger 2003: 82). However, in Heidegger’s final analysis the ubiquity of resources owes not to science or metaphysics but to a ‘mode of revealing’; it owes to an epochal ontological regime that Heidegger calls ‘Enframing’. Nonetheless, Heidegger’s considered view seems to be this: the right comportment could mitigate Enframing and prepare for something different and better.

What though is wrong with the real being revealed as resource? Enframing is ‘monstrous’ (Heidegger 1994: 321). It is monstrous – Heidegger contends – because it is nihilism. Nihilism is a ‘forgetfulness’ of das Sein, a Seinsvergessenheit. Some such forgetfulness is nigh inevitable. We are interested in beings as they present themselves to us. So we overlook the conditions of that presentation, namely, being and Being. But Enframing represents a more thoroughgoing form of forgetfulness. The hegemony of resources makes it especially hard to conceive that beings could be otherwise, which is to say, to conceive that there is something called ‘Being’ that could yield different regimes of being. In fact, Enframing actively denies being/Being. That is because Enframing, or the metaphysics/science that corresponds to it, proceeds as if humanity were the measure of all things and hence as if being, or that which grants being independently of us (Being), were nothing. Such nihilism sounds bearable. But Heidegger lays at its door an impoverishment of culture, a deep kind of homelessness, and the devaluation of the highest values (see Young 2002: ch. 2 and passim). Heidegger goes so far as to trace ‘the events of world history in this [the twentieth] century’ to Seinsvergessenheit (Heidegger in Wolin 1993: 69).

Heidegger’s response to nihilism is ‘thinking’ (Denken). This thinking is a kind of thoughtful questioning. Its object – that which it thinks about – can be the pre-Socratic ideas from which philosophy developed, or philosophy’s history, or Things, or art. Whatever its object, thinking always involves recognition that it is das Sein, albeit in some interplay with humanity, which determines how beings are. Indeed, Heideggerian thinking involves wonder and gratitude in the face of das Sein. Heidegger uses Meister Eckhart’s notion of ‘releasement’ to elaborate upon such thinking. The idea (prefigured, in fact, in Heidegger’s earlier work) is of non-impositional comportment towards beings which lets beings to be what they are. That comportment ‘grant[s] us the possibility of dwelling in the world in a totally different way’. It promises ‘a new ground and a new foundation upon which we can stand and endure in the world of technology without being imperiled by it’ (Heidegger 1966: 55). Heidegger calls the dwelling at issue ‘poetic’ and one way in which he specifies it is via various poets. Moreover, some of Heidegger’s own writing is semi-poetic. A small amount of it actually consists of poems. So it is not entirely surprising to encounter this claim, which Heidegger made when he still counted himself a philosopher: ‘All philosophical thinking [...] is in itself poetic’ (Heidegger 1991, vol. 2: 73). That claim is connected to the centrality that Heidegger gives to language, a centrality that is summed up (a little gnomically) in the statement that language is ‘the house of das Sein’ (Heidegger 1994: 217).

Heideggerian ‘thinking’ has been attacked as (some mixture of) irrationalist, quietist, reactionary, and authoritarian (see for example Adorno 1973 and Habermas 1987b: ch. 6). A related objection is that, though Heidegger claimed to leave theology alone, what he produced was an incoherent reworking of religion (Haar 1993; Philipse 1998). Of the more or less secular or (in Caputo’s term) ‘demythologized’ construals of Heidegger, many are sympathetic and, among those, many fasten upon such topics as technology, nihilism, and dwelling (Borgmann 1984, Young 2002: ch.s 7–9; Feenberg 1999: ch. 8). Other secular admirers – including, notably, Rorty and Derrida – concentrate upon Heidegger’s attempt to interrogate the entire philosophical tradition.

d. Derrida's Post-Structuralism

Structuralism was an international trend in linguistics, literary theory, anthropology, political theory, and other disciplines. It sought to explain phenomena (sounds, tropes, behaviors, norms, beliefs . . .) less via the phenomena themselves, or via their genesis, and more via structures that the phenomena exist within or instantiate. The post-structuralists applied this structural priority to philosophy. They are post-structuralists less because they came after structuralism and more because, in appropriating structuralism, they distanced themselves from the determinism and scientism it often involved (Dews 1987: 1–4). The post-structuralists included Deleuze, Foucault, Lyotard and Lacan (and sometimes post-structuralism is associated with ‘post-modernism’; see Malpas 2003: 7–11). Each of these thinkers (perhaps excepting Lacan) is highly meta­philosophical. But attention is restricted to the best known and most controversial of the post-structuralists, namely, Jacques Derrida.

Derrida practiced ‘deconstruction’ (Déconstruire, la Déconstruction; Derrida adapts the notion of deconstruction from Heidegger's idea of 'destruction', on which latter see section 4.a.ii above). Deconstruction is a ‘textual “operation”’ (Derrida 1987: 3). The notion of text here is a broad one. It extends from written texts to conceptions, discourses, and even practices. Nevertheless, Derrida's early work concentrates upon actual texts and, more often than not, philosophical ones. The reason Derrida puts ‘operation’ (‘textual “operation”’) within scare-quotes is that he holds that deconstruction is no method. That in turn is for two reasons (each of which should become clearer below). First, the nature of deconstruction varies with that which is deconstructed. Second, there is a sense in which texts deconstruct themselves. Nonetheless: deconstruction, as a practice, reveals such alleged self-deconstruction; and that practice does have a degree of regularity. The practice of deconstruction has several stages. (In presenting those stages, ‘text’ is taken in the narrow sense. Moreover, it is presumed that in each case a single text is, at least centrally, at issue.)

Deconstruction begins with a commentary (Derrida 1976: 158) - with a ‘faithful’ and ‘interior’ reading of a text (Derrida 1987: 6). Within or via such commentary, the focus is upon metaphysical oppositions. Derrida understands metaphysics as ‘the metaphysics of presence’ (another notion adapted from Heidegger); and an opposition belongs to metaphysics (pleonastically, the metaphysics of presence) just in case: (i) it contains a privileged term and a subordinated term; and (ii) the privileged term has to do with presence. ‘Presence’ is presence to consciousness and/or the temporal present. The oppositions at issue include not only presence–absence (construed in either of the two ways just indicated) but also, and among others (and with the term that is privileged within each opposition given first) these: ‘normal/abnormal, standard/parasitic, fulfilled/void, serious/nonserious, literal/nonliteral’ (Derrida 1988: 93).

The next step in deconstruction is to show that the text undermines its own metaphysical oppositions. That is: the privileged terms reveal themselves to be less privileged over the subordinate terms – less privileged vis-à-vis presence, less ‘simple, intact, normal, pure, standard, self-identical’ (Derrida 1988: 93) – than they give themselves out to be. Here is a common way in which Derrida tries to establish the point. He tries to show that a privileged term essentially depends upon, or shares some crucial feature(s) with, its supposed subordinate. One of Derrida’s deconstructions of Husserl can serve as an example. Husserl distinguishes mental life, which he holds to be inherently intentional (inherently characterized by aboutness) from language, which is intentional only via contingent association with such states. Thereby Husserl privileges the mental over the linguistic. However: Husserl’s view of the temporality of experience entails that the presence he makes criterial for intrinsic intentionality – a certain presence of meanings to the mind – is always partially absent. Or so Derrida argues (Derrida, section 4). A second strategy of Derrida’s ‘is to apply a distinction onto itself reflexively and thus show that it itself is imbued with the disfavored term’ (Landau, 1992/1993: 1899). ‘For example, Derrida shows that when Aristotle and other philosophers discuss the nature of metaphors (and thereby the distinction between metaphors and non-metaphors), they use metaphors in the discussions themselves’ (idem) – and so fail in their attempts to relegate or denigrate metaphor. A further strategy involves the notion of undecidability (see Derrida, section 5).

A third stage or aspect of deconstruction is, one can say, less negative or more productive (and Derrida himself calls this the productive moment of deconstruction). Consider Derrida’s deconstruction(s) of the opposition between speech and writing. Derrida argues, initially, as follows. Speech – and even thought, understood as a kind of inner speech – shares with writing features that have often been used to present writing as only a poor descendent of speech. Those features include being variously interpretable and being derivative of something else. But there is more. Derrida posits something, which he calls archi-écriture, ‘arche-writing’, which is ‘fundamental to signifying processes in general, a “writing” that is the condition of all forms of expression, whether scriptural, vocal, or otherwise’ (Johnson 1993: 66). Indeed: as well as being a condition of possibility, arche-writing is, in Derrida’s frequent and arresting phrase, a condition of its impossibility. Arche-writing establishes or reveals a limit to any kind of expression (a limit, namely, to the semantic transparency, and the self-sufficiency, of expressions). Other deconstructions proceed similarly. A hierarchical opposition is undermined; a new term is produced through a kind of generalization of the previously subordinate term; and the new term – such as ‘supplement’, ‘trace’ and the neologism différance (Derrida, section 3.c–e) – represents a condition of possibility and impossibility for the opposition in question.

What is the status of these conditions? Sometimes Derrida calls them ‘quasi-transcendental’. That encourages this idea: here we have an account not just of concepts but of things or phenomena. Yet Derrida himself does not quite say that. He denies that we can make any simple distinction between text and world, between conceptual system and phenomena. Such may be part of the thrust of the (in)famous pronouncement, ‘There is nothing outside of the text’ (il n’y a pas de hors-texte; Derrida 1976: 158). Nor does Derrida think that, by providing such notions as arche-writing, he himself wholly evades the metaphysics of presence. ‘We have no language—no syntax and no lexicon—that is foreign to this history; we can pronounce not a single deconstructive proposition which has not already had to slip into the form, the logic, and the implicit postulations of precisely what it seeks to contest’ (Derrida 1990: 280f.). Still: ‘if no one can escape this necessity, and if no one is therefore responsible for giving in to it [...] this does not mean that all the ways of giving in to it are of equal pertinence. The quality and fecundity of a discourse are perhaps measured by the critical rigor with which this relation to the history of metaphysics and to inherited concepts is thought’ (Derrida 1990: 282).

Derrida retained the foregoing views, which he had developed by the end of the 1960s. But there were developments of metaphilosophical significance. (1) In the ’70s, his style became more playful, and his approach to others’ text became more literary (and those changes more or less persisted; Derrida would want to know, however, just what we understand by ‘playful’ and ‘literary’). (2) Again from the ’70s onwards, Derrida joined with others in order to: sustain and promote the teaching of philosophy in schools; to consider philosophy’s role; and to promote philosophy that transgressed disciplinary boundaries. (3) In the ’80s, Derrida tried to show that deconstruction had an ethical and political import. He turned to themes that included cosmopolitanism, decision, forgiveness, law, mourning, racism, responsibility, religion, and terrorism – and claimed, remarkably, that ‘deconstruction is justice’ (Derrida 1999: 15). To give just a hint of this last idea: ‘Justice is what the deconstruction of the law’ – an analysis of the law’s conditions of possibility and impossibility, of its presuppositions and limits – ‘means to bring about’, where ‘law’ means ‘legality, legitimacy, or legitimation (for example)’ (Caputo 1997: 131f.). (On some of these topics, see Derrida, section 7.) (4) By the ’90s, if not earlier, Derrida held that in philosophy the nature of philosophy is always and everywhere at issue (see for instance Derrida 1995: 411).

Despite his views about the difficulty of escaping metaphysics, and despite his evident belief in the critical and exploratory value of philosophy, Derrida has been attacked for undermining philosophy. Habermas provides an instance of the criticism. Habermas argued that Derrida erases the distinction between philosophy and literature. Habermas recognizes that Derrida means to be ‘simultaneously maintaining and relativizing’ the distinction between literature and philosophy (Habermas 1987b: 192). But the result, Habermas thinks, is an effacement of the differences between literature and philosophy. Habermas adds, or infers, that ‘Derrida does not belong to those philosophers who like to argue’ (Habermas 1987b: 193). Derrida objected to being called unargumentative. He objected, also, to Habermas' procedure of using other deconstructionists – those that Habermas deemed more argumentative – as the source for Derrida’s views.

Subsequently, Habermas and Derrida underwent something of a rapprochement. Little reconciliation was achieved in the so-called ‘Derrida affair’, wherein a collection of philosophers, angry that Derrida was to receive an honorary degree from Cambridge, alleged that Derrida ‘does not meet accepted standards of clarity or rigor’ (quoted Derrida 1995: 420; a detailed attack upon Derrida’s scholarship is Evans 1991).

There might be a sense in which Derrida is too rigorous. For he holds this: ‘Every concept that lays claim to any rigor whatsoever implies the alternative of “all or nothing”’ (Derrida 1988: 116). One might reject that view. Might it be, indeed, that Derrida insists upon rigid oppositions ‘in order to legitimate the project of calling them into question’ (Gerald Graff in Derrida 1988: 115)? One might object, also, that Derrida’s interrogation of philosophy is more abstract, more intangible, than most metaphysics. Something Levinas said apropos Derrida serves as a response. ‘The history of philosophy is probably nothing but a growing awareness of the difficulty of thinking’ (Levinas 1996: 55; compare Derrida 1995: 187f.). The following anxiety might persist. Despite Derrida’s so-called ethical and political ‘turns’, and despite the work he has inspired within he humanities, deconstruction little illuminates phenomena that are not much like anything reasonably designatable as a text (Dews 1987: 35). A more general version of the anxiety is that, for all the presentations of Derrida as ‘a philosopher of difference’, deconstruction obscures differences (Kearney 1984: 114; Habermas 1992a: 159).

5. References and Further Reading

Note that, in the case of many of the items that follow, the date given for a text is not the date of its first publication.

a. Explicit Metaphilosophy and Works about Philosophical Movements or Traditions

  • Anscombe, G. E. M. (1957) ‘Does Oxford Moral Philosophy Corrupt Youth?’ in her Human life, Action, and Ethics: Essays, pp. 161–168. Exeter, UK: Imprint Academic, 2005. Edited by Mary Geach and Luke Gormally.
  • Beaney, Michael (2007) ‘The Analytic Turn in Early Twentieth-Century Philosophy’, in Beaney, Michael ed. The Analytic Turn. Essays in Early Analytic Philosophy and Phenomenology, New York and London: Routledge, 2007.
    • Good on, especially, the notions of analysis in early Analytic philosophy and on the historical precedents of those notions.
  • Beaney, Michael (2009) ‘Conceptions of Analysis in Analytic Philosophy’: Supplement to entry on ‘Analysis’, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2009 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).
  • Beauchamp, Tom L. (2002) ‘Changes of Climate in the Development of Practical Ethics’, Science and Engineering Ethics 8: 131–138.
  • Bernstein, Richard J. (2010) The Pragmatic Turn. Cambridge MA and Cambridge.
    • An account of the influence and importance of pragmatism.
  • Chappell, Timothy (2009) ‘Ethics Beyond Moral Theory’ Philosophical Investigations 32: 3 206–243.
  • Chase, James, and Reynolds, Jack (2010) Analytic Versus Continental: Arguments on the Methods and Value of Philosophy. Stocksfield: Acumen.
  • Clarke, Stanley G. (1987) ‘Anti-Theory in Ethics’, American Philosophical Quarterly 24: 3 237–244.
  • Deleuze, Giles, and Guattari, Félix (1994) What is Philosophy? London and New York: Verso. Trans. Graham Birchill and Hugh Tomlinson.
    • Less of an introduction to metaphilosophy than its title might suggest.
  • Galison, Peter (1990) ‘Aufbau/Bauhaus: Logical Positivism and Architectural Modernism’, Critical Inquiry, 16(4[Summer]): 709–752.
  • Glendinning, Simon (2006) The Idea of Continental Philosophy: A Philosophical Chronicle. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • Glock, Hans-Johann (2008) What Is Analytic Philosophy? Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press.
    • Comprehensive. Illuminating. Not introductory.
  • Graham, George and Horgan, Terry (1994) ‘Southern Fundamentalism and the End of Philosophy’, Philosophical Issues 5: 219–247.
  • Lazerowitz, Morris (1970) ‘A Note on “Metaphilosophy”, Metaphilosophy, 1(1): 91–91 (sic).
    • An influential (but very short) definition of metaphilosophy.
  • Levin, Janet (2009) ‘Experimental Philosophy’, Analysis, 69(4) 2009: 761–769.
  • Levy, Neil (2009) ‘Empirically Informed Moral Theory: A Sketch of the Landscape’, Ethical Theory and Moral Practice 12:3–8.
  • McNaughton, David (2009) ‘Why Is So Much Philosophy So Tedious?’, Florida Philosophical Review IX(2): 1-13.
  • Joll, Nicholas (2009) ‘How Should Philosophy Be Clear? Loaded Clarity, Default Clarity, and Adorno’, Telos 146 (Spring): 73–95.
  • Joll, Nicholas (Forthcoming) Review of Jürgen Habermas et al, An Awareness of What Is Missing (Polity, 2010), Philosophy.
    • Tries to clarify and evaluate some of Habermas' thinking on religion.
  • Papineau, David (2009) ‘The Poverty of Analysis’, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume lxxxiii: 1–30.
  • Preston, Aaron (2007) Analytic Philosophy: The History of an Illusion. London and New York: Continuum.
    • Argues, controversially, that Analytic philosophy has never had any substantial philosophical or meta­philosophical unity.
  • Prinz, Jesse J. (2008) ‘Empirical Philosophy and Experimental Philosophy’ in J. Knobe and S. Nichols (eds.) Experimental Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2008.
  • Urmson, J. D. (1956) Philosophical Analysis: Its Development Between the Two World Wars. London: Oxford University Press.
  • Rescher, Nicholas (2006) Philosophical Dialectics. An Essay on Metaphilosophy. Albany: State University of New York Press.
    • Centres upon the notion of philosophical progress. Contains numerous, occasionally gross typographical errors.
  • Rorty, Richard ed. (1992) The Linguistic Turn: Essays in Philosophical Method, Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press. Second edition.
    • A useful study of 1930s to 1960s Analytic metaphilosophy.
  • Rorty, Richard, Schneewind, Jerome B., and Skinner, Quentin eds. (1984) Philosophy in History: Essays in the Historiography of Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sorell, Tom, and Rogers, C. A. J. eds. (2005) Analytic Philosophy and History of Philosophy. Oxford and New York: Oxford.
  • Stewart, Jon (1995) ‘Schopenhauer’s Charge and Modern Academic Philosophy: Some Problems Facing Philosophical Pedagogy’, Metaphilosophy 26(3): 270–278.
  • Taylor, Charles (1984) ‘Philosophy and Its History’, in Rorty, Schneewind, and Skinner 1984.
  • Williams, Bernard (2003) ‘Contemporary Philosophy: A Second Look’ in The Blackwell Companion to Philosophy, ed. Nicholas Bunnin and E. P. Tsui-James, pp. 25–37. Oxford: Blackwell. Second edition.
  • Williamson, Timothy (2007) The Philosophy of Philosophy, Malden MA and Oxford: Blackwell.
    • A dense, rather technical work aiming to remedy what it sees as a meta­philosophical lack in Analytic philosophy. Treats, among other things, these notions: conceptual truth; intuitions; thought experiments.

b. Analytic Philosophy including Wittgenstein, Post-Analytic Philosophy, and Logical Pragmatism

  • Austin, J. L., Philosophical Papers (1979). Third edition. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Burtt, E. A. (1963) ‘Descriptive Metaphysics’, Mind 72(285):18–39.
  • Campbell, Richmond and Hunter, Bruce (2000) ‘Introduction’, in R. Campbell and B. Hunter eds. Moral Epistemology Naturalized, Supple. Vol., Canadian Journal of Philosophy: 1–28.
    • Campbell has a published a similar piece, under the title ‘Moral Epistemology’, in the online resource the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • Carnap (1931) ‘The Elimination of Metaphysics Through Logical Analysis of Language’ in Ayer, A. J. (1959) ed. Logical Positivism. Glencoe IL: The Free Press.
  • Cavell, Stanley (1979) The Claim of Reason. Wittgenstein, Skepticism, Morality, and Tragedy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Cohen, G. A. (2002) ‘Deeper into Bullshit’, in Buss, Sarah and Overton, Lee eds. Contours of Agency: Themes from the Philosophy of Harry Frankfurt, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
    • Adapts Harry Frankfurt’s construal of bullshit in order to diagnose and indict much ‘bullshit in certain areas of philosophical and semi-philosophical culture’ (p. 335). Reprinted in Hardcastle, Gary L. and Reich, George A. eds. Bullshit and Philosophy, Chicago and La Salle, IL: Open Court, 2006.
  • Copi, Irving M. (1949) ‘Language Analysis and Metaphysical Inquiry’ in Rorty 1992.
  • Freeman, Samuel (2007) Rawls. Oxford and New York: Routledge.
  • Gellner, Ernest (2005) Words and Things. An Examination of, and an Attack on, Linguistic Philosophy. Second edition. Abingdon and New York: Routledge.
  • Glock, Hans-Johann (2003a) Quine and Davidson on Language, Thought and Reality. Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Glock, Hans-Johann ed. (2003b) Strawson and Kant. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Haack, Susan (1979) ‘Descriptive and Revisionary Metaphysics’, Philosophical Studies 35: 361–371.
  • Hacker, P. M. S. (2003) ‘On Strawson’s Rehabilitation of Metaphysics’ in Glock ed. 2003b.
  • Hacker, P. M. S. (2007) Human Nature: the Categorial Framework. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Hutchinson, Brian (2001) G. E. Moore’s Ethical Theory: Resistance and Reconciliation. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kripke, Saul A (1980) Naming and Necessity. Oxford: Blackwell. Revised and Enlarged edition.
  • Lance, M. and Little, M., (2006) ‘Particularism and anti-theory’, in D. Copp, ed., The Oxford handbook of ethical theory, Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Loux, Michael J (2002) Metaphysics. A Contemporary Introduction, second ed. Routledge: London and New York.
  • Malcolm, Norman (1984) Ludwig Wittgenstein: a memoir / by Norman Malcolm; with a biographical sketch by G. H. von Wright and Wittgenstein’s Letters to Malcolm. Second ed. Oxford and New York, Oxford University Press.
  • McDowell, John (1994) Mind and World. Cambridge MA and London: Harvard University Press.
    • Perhaps the paradigmatic ‘post-Analytic’ text.
  • McDowell, John (2000) ‘Towards Rehabilitating Objectivity’ in Brandom ed. (2000).
  • McMahon, Jennifer A. (2007) Aesthetics and Material Beauty: Aesthetics Naturalized. New York and London: Routledge.
  • Moore, G. E. (1899) ‘The Nature of Judgement’, in G. E. Moore Selected Writings, London: Routledge, 1993, ed. T. Baldwin.
  • Moore, G. E. (1953) Some Main Problems of Philosophy. New York: Humanities Press.
    • From lectures given in 1910 and 1911.
  • Moore, G. E. (1993) Principia Ethica. Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press.
    • Second and revised edition, containing some other writings by Moore.
  • Neurath, Otto, Carnap, Rudolf, and Hahn, Hans (1996) ‘The Scientific Conception of the World: the Vienna Circle’, in Sarkar, Sahotra ed. The Emergence of Logical Empiricism: from 1900 to the Vienna Circle. New York: Garland Publishing, 1996. pp. 321–340.
    • An English translation of the manifesto issued by the Vienna Circle in 1929.
  • Orenstein, Alex (2002) W. V. Quine. Chesham, UK: Acumen.
  • Pitkin, Hanna (1993) Wittgenstein and Justice. On the Significance of Ludwig Wittgenstein for Social and Political Thought. Berkeley and London: University of California Press.
  • Putnam, Hilary (1985) ‘After Empiricism’ in Rajchman and West 1985.
  • Quine, W. V. O. (1960) Word and Object. Cambridge MA: MIT Press.
  • Quine, W. V. O. (1977) Ontological Relativity and Other Essays. New York: Columbia University Press. New edition.
  • Quine, W. V. O. (1980) From A Logical Point of View. Harvard: Harvard University Press. New edition.
  • Quine, W. V. O. (1981) Theories and Things. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Rawls, John (1999a) A Theory of Justice. Revised edition. Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Rawls, John (1999b) Collected Papers ed. Samuel Freeman. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Russell, Bertrand (1992) A Critical Exposition of the Philosophy of Leibniz. London and New York: Routledge.
  • Russell, Bertrand (1995) My Philosophical Development. Abingdon, UK and New York: Routledge.
  • Russell, Bertrand (2009) Our Knowledge of the External World: As a Field for Scientific Method in Philosophy. Abingdon and New York: Routledge.
  • Rynin, David (1956) ‘The Dogma of Logical Pragmatism’, Mind 65(259): 379–391.
  • Schilpp, P. A. ed. (1942) The Philosophy of G. E. Moore Northwestern University Press, Evanston IL.
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur ed. (1942) The Philosophy of G. E. Moore. Evanston and Chicago: Northwestern University Press.
  • Schroeter, François (2004) ‘Reflective Equilibrium and Antitheory’, Noûs, 38(1): 110–134.
  • Schultz, Bart (1992) ‘Bertrand Russell in Ethics and Politics’, Ethics, 102: 3 (April): 594–634.
  • Sellars, Wilfred (1963) Science, Perception and Reality. Routledge & Kegan Paul Ltd; London, and The Humanities Press: New York.
  • Strawson, Peter (1959) Individuals: An Essay in Descriptive Metaphysics. London: Methuen.
  • Strawson, Peter (1991) Analysis and Metaphysics. An Introduction to Philosophy. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
    • Both an introduction to philosophy and an introduction to Strawson’s own philosophical and meta­philosophical views.
  • Strawson, Peter (2003) ‘A Bit of Intellectual Autobiography’ in Glock ed. 2003b.
  • Weinberg, Jonathan M., Nichols, Shaun and Stitch, Stephen (2001) ‘Normativity and Epistemic Intuitions’, Philosophical Topics, 29(1&2): 429–460.
  • Williams, Bernard (1981) Moral Luck. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig (1961) Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus. Trans. D.F. Pears and B.F. McGuinness. Routledge: London.
    • The title means ‘schema of philosophical logic’.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig (1966) Lectures and Conversations on Aesthetics, Psychology and Religious Belief. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig (1969) The Blue and Brown Books. Preliminary Studies for the “Philosophical Investigations”. Blackwell: Oxford.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig (2001) Philosophical Investigations. The German Text, with a Revised English Translation. Malden MA and Oxford: Blackwell. Third edition. Trans. G. E. M. Anscombe.
    • The major work of the ‘later’ Wittgenstein.
  • Wright, Crispin (2002) ‘Human Nature?’ in Nicholas H. Smith ed. Reading McDowell. On Mind and World. London and New York: Routledge.

c. Pragmatism and Neopragmatism

  • Brandom, Robert B. ed. (2000) Rorty and His Critics. Malden MA and Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Dewey, John (1998) The Essential Dewey, two volumes, Larry Hickman and Thomas M. Alexander eds. Indiana University Press.
  • James, William (1995) Pragmatism: A New Name for Some Old Ways of Thinking. New York: Dover Publications.
    • Lectures.
  • Peirce, C. S. (1931–58) The Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, eds. C. Hartshorne, P. Weiss (Vols. 1–6) and A. Burks (Vols. 7–8). Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Rorty, Richard (1980) Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature. Oxford: Blackwell.
    • Rorty’s magnum opus.
  • Rorty, Richard (1991a) Consequences of Pragmatism (Essays: 1972–1980). Hemel Hempstead, UK: Harvester Wheatsheaf.
  • Rorty, Richard (1991b) ‘The Priority of Democracy to Philosophy’, pp. 175–196 of his Objectivity, Relativism, and Truth. Philosophical Papers, Volume 1. Cambridge, New York and Melbourne: Cambridge University Press.
  • Rorty, Richard (1998) Achieving Our Country. Leftist Thought in Twentieth-Century America. Cambridge MA and London: Harvard University Press.
  • Rorty, Richard (2007) Philosophy as Cultural Politics. Philosophical Papers, Volume 4. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Talisse, Robert B. and Aikin, Scott F. (2008) Pragmatism: A Guide for the Perplexed. Continuum: London and New York.
    • Good and useful.

d. Continental Philosophy

  • Adorno, Theodor W. (1986) The Jargon of Authenticity. London and Henley: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1986; trans. Knut Tarnowski and Frederic Will.
  • Adorno, Theodor W. and Horkheimer, Max (2002) Dialectic of Enlightenment. Philosophical Fragments. Stanford: Stanford University Press. Trans. Edmund Jephcott.
  • Adorno, Theodor W. (1976) with R. Dahrendorf, J. Habermas, H. Pilot, and K. Popper, The Positivist Dispute in German Sociology, trans. G. Adey and D. Frisby, London: Heinemann Educational Books.
    • Documents from debates between Popperians (who were not, in fact, positivists in any strict sense) and the Frankfurt School.
  • Baxter, Hugh (1987) ‘System and Life-World in Habermas' Theory of Communicative ActionTheory and Society 16: 1 (January): 39–86.
  • Braver, Lee (2009) Heidegger’s Later Writings. A Reader’s Guide. London and New York: Continuum.
    • Accessible and helpful, yet perhaps somewhat superficial.
  • Caputo, John D (1977) ‘The Question of Being and Transcendental Phenomenology: Reflections on Heidegger’s relationship to Husserl’, Research in Phenomenology 7 (1):84–105.
  • Caputo, John D (1993) Demythologizing Heidegger. Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press.
    • More ‘Continental’ than one might guess merely from the title.
  • Caputo, John, D (1997) ‘A Commentary’, Part Two of Derrida, Jacques (1997) Deconstruction in a Nutshell. A Conversation with Jacques Derrida. New York: Fordam University Press. Edited and with a commentary by John D. Caputo.
  • Carmen, Taylor, and B. N. Hansen eds. (2005) The Cambridge Companion to Merleau-Ponty. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
  • Cerbone, David (2006) Understanding Phenomenology. Chesham, UK: Acumen.
    • A good introduction to phenomenology.
  • Cooper, David (1999) Existentialism. A Reconstruction 2nd ed. Blackwell: Oxford and Malden, MA
    • Careful, argumentative, fairly accessible.
  • Davis, Colin (1996) Levinas. An Introduction. Cambridge: Polity.
    • Not only introduces Levinas but also mounts a strong challenge to him.
  • Derrida, Jacques (1976) Of Grammatology. Baltimore and London: Johns Hopkins University Press. Trans. G. C. Spivak.
  • Derrida, Jacques (1987) Positions. London: Althone. Trans. Alan Bass.
    • Three relatively early interviews with Derrida. Relatively accessible.
  • Derrida, Jacques (1988) Limited Inc. Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press.
    • Contains Derrida’s side of an (acrimonious) debate with John Searle. Includes an Afterword wherein Derrida answers questions put to him by Gerald Graff.
  • Derrida, Jacques (1990) Writing and Difference. London: Routledge. Trans. Alan Bass.
  • Derrida, Jacques (1995) Points . . . : Interviews, 1974–1994. Trans. Peggy Kamuf et al. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
  • Derrida, Jacques (1999) ‘Force of Law’ in Drucilla Cornell, Michel Rosenfeld, and David Gray Carlson eds. (1982) Deconstruction and the Possibility of Justice, New York: Routledge.
  • Dews, Peter (1987) Logics of Disintegration. Post-stucturalist Thought and the Claims of Critical Theory. London and New York: Verso.
  • Dews, Peter (1995) ‘Morality, Ethics and “Postmetaphysical Thinking”’ in his The Limits of Disenchantment. Essays on Contemporary European Philosophy. London and New York: Verso, 1995.
  • Diprose, Rosalyn and Reynolds, Jack eds. (2008) Merleau-Ponty: Key Concepts. Chesham, UK: Acumen.
  • Dubiel, Daniel (1985) Theory and Politics. Studies in the Development of Critical Theory. Cambridge MA: MIT Press.
  • Edgar, Andrew (2006) Habermas. The Key Concepts. Routledge. London and New York.
  • Elden, Stuart (2004) Understanding Henri Lefebvre: Theory and the Possible. London and New York: Continuum.
  • Evans, J. Claude (1991) Strategies of Deconstruction: Derrida and the Myth of the Voice. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
    • Detailed contestation of Derrida’s interpretation of, especially, Husserl.
  • Finlayson, Gordon (2005) Habermas: A Very Short Introduction. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Finlayson, Gordon (2009) ‘Morality and Critical Theory. On the Normative Problem of Frankfurt School Social Criticism’, Telos (146: Spring): 7–41.
  • Freyenhagen, Fabian (2008) ‘Moral Philosophy’ in Deborah Cook (ed.) Theodor Adorno: Key Concepts. Stocksfield: Acumen.
    • A good and somewhat revisionist synopsis of Adorno’s moral philosophy.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Geog (1981) Reason in the Age of Science. Cambridge MA: MIT. Trans. Frederick Lawrence.
  • Geuss, Raymond (1981) The Idea of a Critical Theory. Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Geuss, Raymond (2008) Philosophy and Real Politics. Princeton and Oxford: Princeton University Press.
  • Glendinning, Simon (2001) ‘Much Ado About Nothing (on Herman Philipse, Heidegger’s Philosophy of Being)’. Ratio 14 (3):281–288.
  • Haar, Michel (1993) Heidegger and the Essence of Man. New York: State University of New York Press. Trans. McNeill, William.
  • Habermas, Jürgen (1984) The Theory of Communicative Action, Volume 1: Reason and the Rationalization of Society. Cambridge: Polity. Trans. McCarthy, Thomas.
  • Habermas, Jürgen (1987a) Knowledge and Human Interests. Cambridge: Polity. Second edition. Trans. Jeremy Shapiro.
  • Habermas, Jürgen (1987b) The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity: Twelve Lectures. Cambridge: Polity Press in association with Blackwell Publishers. Trans. Frederick Lawrence.
    • One of Habermas' more accessible – and more polemical – works.
  • Habermas, Jürgen (1992a) Autonomy and Solidarity. Interviews with Jürgen Habermas. Ed. Peter Dews. Revised edition.
    • A good place to start with Habermas.
  • Habermas, Jürgen (1992b) Postmetaphysical Thinking: Philosophical Essays. Oxford: Polity Press. Trans. William Mark Hohengarten.
  • Habermas, Jürgen (2008) Between Naturalism and Religion. Philosophical Essays. Cambridge and Malden Ma.: Polity. Trans. Ciaran Cronin.
  • Heidegger, Martin (1962) Being and Time. Oxford: Blackwell. Trans. John Macquarrie and Edward Robinson.
    • The ‘early’ Heidegger’s main work.
  • Heidegger, Martin (1966) Discourse on Thinking. A translation of Gelassenheit. New York: Harper & Row. Trans. John M. Anderson and E. Hans Freund.
  • Heidegger, Martin (1971) Poetry, Language, Thought. New York: Harper & Row. Trans. Albert Hofstadter.
  • Heidegger, Martin (1982) The Basic Problems of Phenomenology. Bloomington and Indianapolis: University of Indiana Press. Revised ed. Trans. Albert Hofstadter.
    • Close in its doctrines to Being and Time, but often considerably more accessible.
  • Heidegger, Martin (1991) Nietzsche, 4 volumes. New York: HarperCollins. Trans. David Farrell Krell.
  • Heidegger, Martin (1994) Basic Writings. London: Routledge. Revised and expanded edition.
    • Contains ‘What is Metaphysics?’, ‘Letter on Humanism’, and ‘The Question Concerning Technology’, among other texts.
  • Heidegger, Martin (2003) The End of Philosophy. Chicago: University of Chicago Press. Trans. Joan Stambaugh.
  • Held, David (1990) Introduction to Critical Theory. Cambridge: Polity.
    • Broad-brush and fairly accessible account of first-generation Critical Theory and of the relatively early Habermas.
  • Horkheimer, Max (1937) ‘Traditional and Critical Theory’ in Horkheimer, Critical Theory: Selected Essays. London and New York: Continuum, 1997.
  • Horkheimer, Max (1974) Eclipse of Reason. New York: Continuum.
    • Like Horkheimer and Adorno’s Dialectic of Enlightenment, but more accessible.
  • Husserl, Edmund (1931) Ideas. General Introduction to Pure Phenomenology. George Allen & Unwin Ltd / Humanities Press. Trans. W. R. Boyce Gibson.
    • Kluwer have produced a newer and more accurate version of this book; but the Boyce Gibson version is slightly more readable.
  • Husserl, Edmund (1999) The Idea of Phenomenology Dordrecht: Kluwer. Trans. Lee Hardy.
    • Probably Husserl’s most accessible (or least inaccessible) statement of phenomenology.
  • Husserl, Edmund (1970) The Crisis of the European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology. Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press. Trans. David Carr.
  • Husserl, Edmund (1999) Cartesian Meditations. An Introduction to Phenomenology. Trans. Dorian Cairns. Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Johnson, Christopher (1993) System and Writing in the Philosophy of Jacques Derrida. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Johnson, Christopher (1999) Derrida. The Scene of Writing. New York: Routledge.
    • Good, short, and orientated around Derrida's Of Grammatology.
  • Landau, Iddo (1992/1993 [sic]) ‘Early and Later Deconstruction in the Writings of Jacques Derrida’, Cardozo Law Review, 14: 1895–1909.
    • Unusually clear.
  • Levinas, Emmanuel (1996) Proper Names. Stanford: Stanford University Press.
  • Malpas, Simon (2003) Jean-François Lyotard. Routledge. London and New York.
  • Marcuse, Herbert (1991) One-Dimensional Man. Second edition. Routledge: London.
    • A classic work of first-generation Critical Theory.
  • Merleau-Ponty, Maurice (2002) Phenomenology of Perception. New York: Routledge. Trans. Colin Smith.
    • Merleau-Ponty’s principal work.
  • Mulhall, Stephen (1996) Heidegger and Being and Time. Routledge: London and New York.
  • Outhwaite, William (1994) Habermas. A Critical Introduction. Cambridge. Polity.
  • Pattison, George (2000) The Later Heidegger. London and New York: Routledge.
    • A helpful introduction to ‘the later Heidegger’.
  • Philipse, Herman (1998) Heidegger’s Philosophy of Being: a Critical Interpretation. New Jersey: Princeton University Press.
    • A large, serious, and very controversial work that sets out to understand, but also to demolish much of, Heidegger. Q.v. Glendinning (2001) - which defends Heidegger.
  • Plant, Robert (Forthcoming) ‘This strange institution called “philosophy”: Derrida and the primacy of metaphilosophy’, Philosophy and Social Criticism.
  • Polt, Richard (1999) Heidegger: An Introduction. London: UCL Press.
    • Superb introduction, but light on the later Heidegger.
  • Russell, Matheson (2006) Husserl: A Guide for the Perplexed. London and New York: Continuum.
    • Excellent.
  • Sartre, Jean-Paul (1963) The Problem of Method. Trans. Hazel E. Barnes. London: Methuen.
  • Sartre, Jean-Paul (1989) Being and Nothingness. An Essay on Phenomenological Ontology. London: Routledge. Trans. Hazel E. Barnes.
    • The early Sartre’s major work.
  • Sartre, Jean-Paul (1992) Notebooks for an Ethics. Chicago and London: Chicago University Press. Trans. David Pellauer.
  • Sartre, Jean-Paul (2004) The Transcendence of the Ego. A Sketch for a Phenomenological Description. Abingdon, U.K.
  • Sartre, Jean-Paul (2007) Existentialism and Humanism. London: Methuen. Trans. Philip Mairet.
    • Sartre’s philosophy at its most accessible.
  • Smith, David (2003) Husserl and the Cartesian Meditations. London and New York: Routledge.
  • Smith, Joel (2005) ‘Merleau-Ponty and the Phenomenological Reduction’, Inquiry 48(6): 553–571.
  • Wolin, Richard, ed. (1993) The Heidegger Controversy: A Critical Reader. Cambridge MA and London: MIT Press.
    • The controversy in question concerns Heidegger’s Nazism. See also Young 1997.
  • Young, Julian (1997) Heidegger, Philosophy, Nazism. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Young, Julian (2002) Heidegger’s Later Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • A slim introduction to, and an attempt to make compelling, the thought of the later Heidegger.

e. Other

  • Borgmann, Albert (1984) Technology and the Character of Everyday Life: A Philo­sophical Inquiry. Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press.
    • Interesting and impassioned. Influenced by Heidegger.
  • Descartes, René (1988) The Philosophical Writings Of Descartes (3 vols). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Trans. John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, and Dugald Murdoch. Volume one.
  • Feenberg, Andrew (1999) Questioning Technology. London and New York: Routledge.
    • This book has at least one foot in the Critical Theory tradition but also appropriates some ideas from Heidegger.
  • Hume, David (1980) Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion and the Posthumous Essays ‘Of the Immortality of the Soul’ and ‘Of Suicide.’ Indianapolis: Hackett. Ed. Richard H. Popkin.
  • Kant, Immanuel Critique of Pure Reason. Various translations.
    • As is standard, the article above refers to this work using the ‘A’ and ‘B’ nomenclature. The number(s) following ‘A’ denote pages from Kant’s first edition of the text. Number(s) following ‘B’ denote pages from Kant’s second edition.
  • Locke, John (1975) An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • O’Neill, John (2003) ‘Unified Science as Political Philosophy: Positivism, Pluralism and Liberalism’, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science, vol. 34 (September): 575–596.
  • O’Neill, John and Uebel, Thomas (2004) ‘Horkheimer and Neurath: Restarting a Disrupted Debate’, European Journal of Philosophy, 12:1 75–105.
  • Petitot, Jean, Varela, Francisco, Pachoud, Bernard, and Roy, Jean-Michel eds. (2000) Naturalizing Phenomenology: Issues in Contemporary Phenomenology and Cognitive Science. Stanford: Stanford University Press.

Author Information

Nicholas Joll
United Kingdom

Russian Philosophy

RussiaThis article provides a historical survey of Russian philosophers and thinkers. It emphasizes Russian epistemological concerns rather than ontological and ethical concerns, hopefully without neglecting or disparaging them. After all, much work in ethics, at least during the Soviet period, strictly supported the state, such that what is taken to be good is often that which helps secure the goals of Soviet society. Unlike most other major nations, political events in Russia's history played large roles in shaping its periods of philosophical development.

Various conceptions of Russian philosophy have led scholars to locate its start at different moments in history and with different individuals. However, few would dispute that there was a religious orientation to Russian thought prior to Peter the Great (around 1700) and that professional, secular philosophy—in which philosophical issues are considered on their own terms without explicit appeal to their utility—arose comparatively recently in the country's history.

Despite the difficulties, we can distinguish five major periods in Russian philosophy. In the first period (The Period of Philosophical Remarks), there is a clear emergence of something resembling what we would now characterize as philosophy. However, religious and political conservativism imposed many restrictions on the dissemination of philosophy during this time. The second period (The Philosophical Dark Age) was marked by much forced silence of the Russian philosophical community. Many subsumed philosophy under the scope of religion or politics, and the discipline was evaluated primarily by whether it was of any utility. The third period (The Emergence of Professional Philosophy) showed an increase in many major Russian thinkers, many of which were influenced by philosophers of the West, such as Plato, Kant, Spinoza, Hegel, and Husserl. The rise of Russian philosophy that was not beholden to religion and politics also began in this period. In the fourth period (The Soviet Era), there were significant concerns about the primacy of the natural sciences. This spawned, for example, the debate between those who thought all philosophical problems would be resolved by the natural sciences (the mechanists) and those who defended the existence of philosophy as a separate discipline (the Deborinists). The fifth period (The Post-Soviet Era) is surely too recent to fully describe. However, there has certainly been a rediscovery of the works of the religious philosophers that were strictly forbidden in the past.

Table of Contents

  1. Overview of the Problem
    1. Masaryk
    2. Lossky and Zenkovsky
    3. Shpet
    4. Concluding Remarks
  2. Historical Periods
    1. The Period of Philosophical Remarks (c.1755-1825)
    2. The Philosophical Dark Age (c. 1825-1860)
    3. The Emergence of Professional Philosophy (c. 1860-1917)
    4. The Soviet Era (1917-1991)
    5. The Post-Soviet Era (1991-)
  3. Concluding Remarks
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Overview of the Problem

The very notion of Russian philosophy poses a cultural-historical problem. No consensus exists on which works it encompasses and which authors made decisive contributions. To a large degree, a particular ideological conception of Russian philosophy, of what constitutes its essential traits, has driven the choice of inclusions. In turn, the various conceptions have led scholars to locate the start of Russian philosophy at different moments and with different individuals.

a. Masaryk

Among the first to deal with this issue was T. Masaryk (1850-1937), a student of Franz Brentano's and later the first president of the newly formed Czechoslovakia. Masaryk, following the lead of a pioneering Russian scholar E. Radlov (1854-1928), held that Russian thinkers have historically given short shrift to epistemological issues in favor of ethical and political discussions. For Masaryk, even those who were indebted to the ethical teachings of Immanuel Kant (1724-1804), scarcely understood and appreciated his epistemological criticism, which they viewed as essentially subjectivistic. True, Masaryk does comment that the Russian mind is "more inclined" to mythology than the Western European—a position that could lead us to conclude that he viewed the Russian mind as in some way innately different from others. However, he makes clear that the Russian predilection for unequivocal acceptance or total negation of a viewpoint stems, at least to a large degree, from the native Orthodox faith. Church teachings had "accustomed" the Russian mind to accept doctrinaire revelation without criticism. For this reason, Masaryk certainly placed the start of Russian philosophy no earlier than the 19th century with the historiosophical musings of P. Chaadaev (1794-1856), who not surprisingly also pinned blame for the country's position in world affairs on its Orthodox faith.

b. Lossky and Zenkovsky

Others, particularly ethnic Russians, alarmed by what they took to be Masaryk's implicit denigration of their intellectual character, have denied that Russian philosophy suffered from a veritable absence of epistemological inquiry. For N. Lossky (1870-1965), Russian philosophers admittedly have, as a rule, sought to relate their investigations, regardless of the specific concern, to ethical problems. This, together with a prevalent epistemological view that externality is knowable—and indeed through an immediate grasping or intuition—has given Russian philosophy a form distinct from much of modern Western philosophy. Nevertheless, the relatively late emergence of independent Russian philosophical thought was a result of the medieval "Tatar yoke" and of the subsequent cultural isolation of Russia until Peter the Great's opening to the West. Even then, Russian thought remained heavily indebted to developments in Germany until the emergence of 19th century Slavophilism with I. Kireyevsky (1806-56) and A. Khomiakov (1804-60).

Even more emphatically than Lossky, V. Zenkovsky (1881-1962) denied the absence of epistemological inquiry in Russian thought. In his eyes, Russian philosophy rejected the primacy accorded, at least since Kant, to the theory of knowledge over ethical and ontological issues. A widespread, though not unanimous, view among Russian philosophers, according to Zenkovsky, is ontologism (that is, that knowledge plays but a secondary role in human existential affairs). Yet, whereas many Russians historically have advocated such an ontologism, it is by no means unique to that nation. More characteristic of Russian philosophy, for Zenkovsky, is its anthropocentrism (that is, a concern with the human condition and humanity's ultimate fate). For this reason, philosophy in Russia has historically been expressed in terms noticeably different from those in the West. Furthermore, like Lossky, Zenkovsky saw the comparatively late development of Russian philosophy as a result of the country's isolation and subsequent infatuation with Western modes of thought until the 19th century. Thus, although Zenkovsky placed Kireyevsky only at the "threshold" of a mature, independent "Russian philosophy" (understood as a system), the former believed it possible to trace the first independent stirrings back to G. Skovoroda (1722-94), who, strictly speaking, was the first Russian philosopher.

Largely as a result of rejecting the primacy of epistemology and the Cartesian model of methodological inquiry, Lossky (and Zenkovsky even more) included within "Russian philosophy" figures whose views would hardly qualify for inclusion within contemporary Western treatises in the history of philosophy. During the Soviet period, Russian scholars appealed to the Marxist doctrine linking intellectual thought to the socio-economic base for their own rather broad notion of philosophy. Any attempt at confining their history to what passes for professionalism today in the West was simply dismissed as "bourgeois." In this way, such literary figures as Dostoyevsky and Tolstoy were routinely included in texts, though just as routinely condemned for their own supposedly bourgeois mentality. Western studies devoted to the history of Russian philosophy have largely since their emergence acquiesced in this acceptance of a broad understanding of philosophy. F. Copleston, for example, conceded that "for historical reasons" philosophy in Russia tended to be informed by a socio-political orientation. Such an apology for his book-length study can be seen as somewhat self-serving, since he recognizes that philosophy as a theoretical discipline never flourished in Russia. Likewise, A. Walicki fears viewing the history of Russian philosophy from the contemporary Western technical standpoint would result in an impoverished picture populated with wholly unoriginal authors. Obviously, one cannot write a history of some discipline if that discipline lacks content!

c. Shpet

Of those seemingly unafraid to admit the historical poverty of philosophical thought in Russia, Gustav Shpet (1879-1937) stands out not only for his vast historical erudition but also because of his own original philosophical contributions. Shpet, almost defiantly, characterized the intellectual life of Russia as rooted in an "elemental ignorance." Unlike Masaryk, however, Shpet did not view this dearth as stemming from Russia's Orthodox faith but from his country's linguistic isolation. The adopted language of the Bulgars lacked a cultural and intellectual tradition. Without a heritage by which to appreciate ideas, intellectual endeavors were valued for their utility alone. Although the government saw no practical benefit in it, the Church initially found philosophy useful as a weapon to safeguard its position. This toleration extended no further, and certainly the clerical authorities countenanced no divergence or independent creativity. With Peter the Great's governmental reforms, the state saw the utility of education and championed those and only those disciplines that served a bureaucratic and apologetic function. After the successful military campaign against Napoleon, many young Russian officers had their first experience of Western European culture and returned to Russia with incipient revolutionary ideas that, in a relatively short time, found expression in the abortive Decembrist Uprising of 1825. Finally, towards the end of the 1830s a new group, a "nihilistic intelligentsia," appeared that preached a toleration of cultural forms, including philosophy, but only insofar as they served the "people." Such was the fate of philosophy in Russia that it was virtually never viewed as anything but a tool or weapon and had to incessantly demonstrate this utility on fear of losing its legitimacy. Shpet concludes that philosophy as knowledge, as being of value for its own sake, was never given a chance.

d. Concluding Remarks

Regardless of the date from which we place the start of Russian philosophy and its first practitioner—and we will have more to say on this topic as we go—few would dispute the religious orientation of Russian thought prior to Peter the Great and that professional secular philosophy arose comparatively recently in the country's history. If we are to avoid a double standard, one for "Western" thought and another for Russian, which is not merely self-serving but also condescending, then we must examine the historical record for indisputable instances of philosophical thought that would be recognized as such regardless of where they originated. Although, on the whole, our inclusions, omissions, and evaluations may more closely resemble those of Shpet than, say, Lossky, we thereby need not invoke any metaphysical historical scheme to justify them.

How precisely to subdivide the history of Russian philosophy has also been a subject of some controversy. In his pioneering study from 1898, A. Vvedensky (see below), Russia's foremost neo-Kantian, found three periods up to his time. Of course, in light of 20th century events his list must be revisited, reexamined, and expanded. We can readily discern five periods in Russian philosophy, the last of which is still too recent to characterize. Unlike most major nations, specific extra-philosophical (namely, political) events clearly played a major role, if not the sole role, in terminating a period.

2. Historical Periods

a. The Period of Philosophical Remarks (c.1755-1825)

Although one can find scattered remarks of a philosophical nature in Russian writings before the mid-eighteenth century, these are at best of marginal interest to the professionally trained philosopher. For the most part, these remarks were not intended to stand as rational arguments in support of a position. Even in the ecclesiastic academies, the thin scholastic veneer of the accepted texts was merely a traditional schematic device, a relic from the time when the only appropriate texts available were Western. For whatever reason, only with the opening of the nation's first university in Moscow in 1755 do we see the emergence of something resembling philosophy, as we use that term today. Even then, however, the floodgates did not burst wide open. The first occupant of the chair of philosophy, N. Popovsky (1730-1760), was more suited to the teaching of poetry and rhetoric, to which chair he was shunted after one brief year.

Sensing the dearth of adequately trained native personnel, the government invited two Germans to the university, thus initiating a practice that would continue well into the next century. The story of the first ethnic Russian to hold the professorship in philosophy for any significant length of time is itself indicative of the precarious existence of philosophy in Russia for much of its history. Having already obtained a magister's degree in 1760 with a thesis entitled "Rassuzhdenie o bessmertii dushi chelovechoj" ("A Treatise on the Immortality of the Human Soul"), Dmitry Anichkov (1733-1788) submitted in 1769 a dissertation on natural religion. Anichkov's dissertation was found to contain atheistic opinions and was subjected to a lengthy 18-year investigation. Legend has it that the dissertation was publicly burned, although there is no firm evidence for this. As was common at the time, Anichkov used Wolffian philosophy manuals and during his first years taught in Latin.

Another notable figure at this time was S. Desnitsky (~1740-1789), who taught jurisprudence at Moscow University. Desnitsky attended university in Glasgow, where he studied under Adam Smith (1723-1790) and became familiar with the works of David Hume (1711-1776). The influence of Smith and British thought in general is evident in memoranda from February 1768 that Desnitsky wrote on government and public finance. Some of these ideas, in turn, appeared virtually verbatim in a portion of Catherine the Great's famous Nakaz, or Instruction, published in April of that year.

Also in 1768 appeared Ya. Kozelsky's Filosoficheskie predlozhenija (Philosophical Propositions), an unoriginal but noteworthy collection of numbered statements on a host of topics, not all of which were philosophical in a technical, narrow sense. By his own admission, the material dealing with "theoretical philosophy" was drawn from the Wolffians, primarily Baumeister, and that dealing with "moral philosophy" from the French Enlightenment thinkers, primarily Rousseau, Montesquieu, and Helvetius. The most interesting feature of the treatise is its acceptance of a social contract, of an eight-hour workday, the explicit rejection of great disparities of wealth and its silence on religion as a source of morality. Nevertheless, in his "theoretical philosophy," Kozelsky (1728-1795) rejected atomism and the Newtonian conception of the possibility of empty space.

During Catherine's reign, plans were made to establish several universities in addition to that in Moscow. Of course, nothing came of these. Moscow University itself had a difficult time attracting a sufficient number of students, most of whom came from poorer families. Undoubtedly, given the state of the Russian economy and society, the virtually ubiquitous attitude was that the study of philosophy was a sheer luxury with no utilitarian value. In terms of general education, the government evidently concluded that sending students abroad offered a better investment than spending large sums at home where the infrastructure needed much work and time to develop. Unfortunately, although there were some who returned to Russia and played a role in the intellectual life of the country, many more failed to complete their studies for a variety of reasons, including falling into debt. Progress, however, skipped a beat in 1796 when Catherine's son and successor, Paul, ordered the recall of all Russian students studying abroad.

Despite its relatively small number of educational institutions, Russia felt a need to invite foreign scholars to help staff these establishments. One of the scholars, J. Schaden (1731-1797), ran a private boarding school in Moscow in addition to teaching philosophy at the university. The most notorious incident from these early years, however, involves the German Ludwig Mellman, who in the 1790s introduced Kant's thought into Russia. Mellman's advocacy found little sympathy even among his colleagues at Moscow University, and in a report to the Tsar the public prosecutor charged Mellman with "mental illness." Not only was Mellman dismissed from his position, but he was forced to leave Russia as well.

Under the initiative of the new Tsar, Alexander I, two new universities were opened in 1804. With them, the need for adequately trained professors again arose. Once more the government turned to Germany, and, with the dislocations caused by the Napoleonic Wars, Russia stood in an excellent position to reap an intellectual harvest. Unfortunately, many of these invited scholars left little lasting impact on Russian thought. For example, one of the most outstanding, Johann Buhle (1763-1821), had already written a number of works on the history of philosophy before taking up residence in Moscow. Yet, once in Russia, his literary output plummeted, and his ignorance of the local language certainly did nothing to extend his influence.

Nonetheless, the sudden influx of German scholars, many of whom were intimately familiar with the latest philosophical developments, acted as an intellectual tonic on others. The arrival of the Swiss physicist Franz Bronner (1758-1850) at the new University of Kazan may have introduced Kant's epistemology to the young future mathematician Lobachevsky. The Serb physicist, A. Stoikovich (1773-1832), who taught at Kharkov University, prepared a text for class use in which the content was arranged in conformity with Kant's categories. One of the earliest Russian treatments of a philosophical topic, however, was A. Lubkin's two "Pis'ma o kriticheskoj filosofii" ("Letters on Critical Philosophy") from 1805. Lubkin (1770/1-1815), who at the time taught at the Petersburg Military Academy, criticized Kant's theory of space and time for its agnostic implications saying that we obtain our concepts of space and time from experience. Likewise, in 1807 a professor of mathematics at Kharkov University, T. Osipovsky (1765-1832), delivered a subsequently published speech "O prostranstve i vremeni" ("On Space and Time"), in which he questioned whether, given the various considerations, Kant's position was the only logical conclusion possible. Assuming the Leibnizian notion of a preestablished harmony, we can uphold all of Kant's specific observations concerning space and time without concluding that they exist solely within our cognitive faculty. Osipovsky went on to make a number of other perceptive criticisms of Kant's position, though Kant's German critics already voiced many of these during his lifetime.

In the realm of social and political philosophy, as understood today, the most interesting and arguably the most sophisticated document from the period of the Russian Enlightenment is A. Kunitsyn's Pravo estestvennoe (Natural Law). In his summary text consisting of 590 sections, Kunitsyn (1783-1840) clearly demonstrated the influence of Kant and Rousseau, holding that rational dictates concerning human conduct form moral imperatives, which we feel as obligations. Since each of us possesses reason, we must always be treated morally as ends, never as means toward an end. In subsequent paragraphs, Kunitsyn elaborated his conception of natural rights, including his belief that among these rights is freedom of thought and expression. His outspoken condemnation of serfdom, however, is not one that the Russian authorities could either have missed or passed over. Shortly after the text reached their attention, all attainable copies were confiscated, and Kunitsyn himself was dismissed from his teaching duties at St. Petersburg University in March 1821.

Another scholar associated with St. Petersburg University was Aleksandr I. Galich (1783-1848). Sent to Germany for further education, he there became acquainted with the work of Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling (1775-1854). With his return to Russia in 1813, he was appointed adjunct professor of philosophy at the Pedagogical Institute in St. Petersburg; and in 1819, when the institute was transformed into a university, Galich was named to the chair of philosophy. His teaching career, however, was short-lived, for in 1821 Galich was charged with atheism and revolutionary sympathies. Although stripped of teaching duties, he continued to draw a full salary until 1837. Galich's importance lays not so much in his own quasi-Schellingian views as his pioneering treatments of the history of philosophy, aesthetics and philosophical anthropology. His two-volume Istorija filosofskikh sistem (History of Philosophical Systems) from 1818-19 concluded with an exposition of Schelling's position and contained quite probably the first discussion in Russian of G.W.F. Hegel (1770-1831) and, in particular, of his Science of Logic. Galich's Opyt nauki izjashchnogo (An Attempt at a Science of the Beautiful) from 1825 is certainly among the first Russian treatises in aesthetics. For Galich, the beautiful is the sensuous manifestation of truth and as such is a sub-discipline within philosophy. His 1834 work, Kartina cheloveka (A Picture of Man), marked the first Russian foray into philosophical anthropology. For Galich all "scientific" disciplines, including theology, are in need of an anthropological foundation; and, moreover, such a foundation must recognize the unity of the human aspects and functions, be they corporeal or spiritual.

The increasing religious and political conservativism that marked Tsar Alexander's later years imposed onerous restrictions on the dissemination of philosophy, both in the classroom and in print. By the time of the Tsar's death in 1825, most reputable professors of philosophy had already been administratively silenced or cowed into compliance. At the end of that year, the aborted coup known as the "Decembrist Uprising"—many of whose leaders had been exposed to the infection of Western European thought—only hardened the basically anti-intellectual attitude of the new Tsar Nicholas. Shortly after I. Davydov (1792/4-1863), hardly either an original or a gifted thinker, had given his introductory lecture "O vozmozhnosti filosofii kak nauki" ("On the Possibility of Philosophy as Science") in May 1826 as professor of philosophy at Moscow University, the chair was temporarily abolished and Davydov shifted to teaching mathematics.

b. The Philosophical Dark Age (c. 1825-1860)

The reign of Nicholas I (1825-1855) was marked by intellectual obscurantism and an enforced philosophical silence, unusual even by Russian standards. The Minister of Public Education, A. Shishkov, blamed the Decembrist Uprising explicitly on the contagion of foreign ideas. To prevent their spread, he and Nicholas's other advisors restricted the access of non-noble youths to higher education and had the tsar enact a comprehensive censorship law that held publishers legally responsible even after the official censor's approval of a manuscript. Yet the scope of this new "cast-iron statute" was conceived so broadly that even at the time it was remarked that the Lord's Prayer could be interpreted as revolutionary speech. While prevented an outlet in a dedicated professional manner at the universities, philosophy found energetic, though amateurish, expression first in the faculties of medicine and physics and then later in fashionable salons and social gatherings—where discipline, rigor and precision were held of little value. During these years, those empowered to teach philosophy at the universities struggled with the task of justifying the very existence of their discipline, not in terms of a search for truth, but as having some social utility. Given the prevailing climate of opinion, this proved to be a hard sell. The news of revolutions in Western Europe in 1848 was the last straw. All talk of reform and social change was simply ruled impermissible, and travel beyond the Empire's borders was forbidden. Finally, in 1850, the minister of education took the step that was thought too extreme in the 1820s: in order to protect Russia from the latest philosophical systems, and therefore intellectual infection, the teaching of philosophy in public universities was simply to be eliminated. Logic and psychology were permitted, but only in the safe hands of theology professors. This situation persisted until 1863, when, in the aftermath of the humiliating Crimean War, philosophy reentered the public academic arena. Even then, however, severe restrictions on its teaching persisted until 1889!

Nevertheless, despite the oppressive atmosphere, some independent philosophizing emerged during the Nicholas years. At first, Schelling's influence dominated abstract discussions, particularly those concerning the natural sciences and their place with regard to the other academic disciplines. However, the two chief Schellingians of the era—D. Vellansky (1774-1847) and M. Pavlov (1793-1840)—both valued German Romanticism, more for its sweeping conclusions than for either its arguments or its being the logical outcome of a philosophical development that had begun with Kant. Though both Vellansky and Pavlov penned a considerable number of works, none of them would find a place within today's philosophy curriculum. Slightly later, in the 1830s and '40s, the discussion turned to Hegel's system, again with great enthusiasm but with little understanding either with what Hegel actually meant or with the philosophical backdrop of his writings. Not surprisingly, Hegel's own self-described "voyage of discovery," the Phenomenology of Spirit, remained an unknown text. Suffice it to say that, but for the dearth of original competent investigations at this time, the mere mention of the Stankevich and the Petrashevsky circles, the Slavophiles and the Westernizers, etc. in a history of philosophy text would be regarded a travesty.

Nevertheless, amid the darkness of official obscurantism, there were a few brief glimmers of light. In his 1833 Vvedenie v nauku filosofii (Introduction to the Science of Philosophy), F. Sidonsky (1805-1873) treated philosophy as a rational discipline independent of theology. Although conterminous with theology, Sidonsky regarded philosophy as both a necessary and a natural searching of the human mind for answers that faith alone cannot adequately supply. By no means did he take this to mean that faith and reason conflict. Revelation provides the same truths, but the path taken, though dogmatic and therefore rationally unsatisfying, is considerably shorter. Much more could be said about Sidonsky's introductory text, but both it and its author were quickly consigned to the margins of history. Notwithstanding his book's desired recognition in some secular circles, Sidonsky soon after its publication was shifted first from philosophy to the teaching of French and then simply dismissed from the St. Petersburg Ecclesiastic Academy in 1835. This time it was the clerical authorities who found his book, it was said, insufficiently rigorous from the official religious standpoint. Sidonsky spent the next 30 years (until the re-introduction of philosophy in the universities) as a parish priest in the Russian capital.

Among those who most resolutely defended the autonomy of philosophy during this "Dark Age" were O. Novitsky (1806-1884) and I. Mikhnevich (1809-1885), both of whom taught for a period at the Kiev Ecclesiastic Academy. Although neither was a particularly outstanding thinker and left no enduring works on the perennial philosophical problems, both stand out for refusing simply to subsume philosophy to religion or politics. Novitsky in 1834 accepted the professorship in philosophy at the new Kiev University, where he taught until the government's abolition of philosophy, after which he worked as a censor. Mikhnevich, on the other hand, became an administrator.

One of the most interesting pieces of philosophical analysis from this time came from another Kiev scholar, S. Gogotsky (1813-1889). In his undergraduate thesis "Kriticheskij vzgljad na filosofiju Kanta" ("A Critical Look at Kant's Philosophy") from 1847, Gogotsky approached his topic from a moderate and informed Hegelianism, unlike that of his more vocal but dilettantish contemporaries. For Gogotsky, Kant's thought represented a distinct improvement over the positions of empiricism and rationalism. However, he demonstrated his own extremism through his advocacy of such ideas as that of the uncognizability of things in themselves, the rejection of the real existence of things in space and time, the sharp dichotomy between moral duty and happiness, and so on. During this "Dark Age," Gogotsky continued at Kiev University but taught pedagogy and remained silent on philosophical issues.

From our standpoint today, one of the most important characteristics of the philosophizing of the early "Kiev School" is the stress placed on the history of Western philosophy and particularly on epistemology. Mikhnevich, for example, wrote, "philosophy is the Science of consciousness... of the subject and the nature of our consciousness." Based on statements such as this, some (A.Vvedensky, A. Nikolsky) have seen the influence of Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762-1814).

The teaching of philosophy at this time was not eliminated from the ecclesiastic academies; the separate institutions of higher education were parallel to the secular universities for those from a clerical background. Largely with good reason, the government felt secure about their political and intellectual passivity. Among the most noteworthy of the professors at an ecclesiastic academy during the Nicholaevan years was F. Golubinsky (1798-1854), who taught in Moscow. Generally recognized as the founder of the "Moscow School of Theistic Philosophy," his historical importance lies solely in his unabashed subordination of philosophy to theology and epistemology to ontology. For Golubinsky, humans seek knowledge in an attempt to recover an original diremption, a lost intimacy with the Infinite! Nevertheless, the idea of God is felt immediately within us. Owing to this immediacy, there is no need for and cannot be a proof of God's existence. Such was the tenor of "philosophical" thought in the religious institutions of the time.

At the very end of the "Dark Age" one figure—the Owl of Minerva (or was it a phoenix?)—emerged who combined the scholarly erudition of his Kiev predecessors with the dominating "ontologism" of the theistic apologists, such as Golubinsky. P. Jurkevich (1826-1874) stood with one foot in the Russian philosophical past and one in the future. Serving as the bridge between the eras, he largely defined the contours along which philosophical discussions would be shaped for the next two generations.

c. The Emergence of Professional Philosophy (c. 1860-1917)

While a professor of philosophy at the Kiev Ecclesiastic Academy, Jurkevich in 1861 caught the attention of a well-connected publisher with a long essay in the obscure house organ of the Academy attacking Chernyshevsky's materialism and anthropologism, which at the time were all the rage among Russia's youth. Having decided to re-introduce philosophy to the universities, the government, nevertheless, worried, lest a limited and controlled measure of independent thought get out of hand. The decision to appoint Jurkevich to the professorship at Moscow University, it was hoped, would serve the government's ends while yet combating fashionable radical trends.

In a spate of articles from his last three years in Kiev, Jurkevich forcefully argued in support of a number of seemingly disconnected theses but all of which demonstrated his own deep commitment to a Platonic idealism. His most familiar stance, his rejection of the popular materialism of the day, was directed not actually at metaphysical materialism but at a physicalist reductionism. Among the points Jurkevich made was that no physiological description could do justice to the revelations offered by introspective psychology and that the transformation of quantity into quality occurred not in the subject, as the materialists held, but in the interaction between the object and the subject. Jurkevich did not rule out the possibility that necessary forms conditioned this interaction, but, in keeping with the logic of this notion, he ruled out an uncognizable "thing in itself" conceived as an object without any possible subject.

Although Jurkevich already presented the scheme of his overall philosophical approach in his first article "Ideja" ("The Idea") from 1859, his last, "Razum po ucheniju Platona i opyt po ucheniju Kanta" ("Plato's Theory of Reason and Kant's Theory of Experience"), written in Moscow, is today his most readable work. In it, he concluded (as did Spinoza and Hegel before him) that epistemology cannot serve as first philosophy—that is, that a body of knowledge need not and, indeed, cannot begin by asking for the conditions of its own possibility; in Jurkevich's best-known expression: "In order to know it is unnecessary to have knowledge of knowledge itself." Kant, he held, conceived knowledge not in the traditional, Platonic sense, as knowledge of what truly is, but in a radically different sense as knowledge of the universally valid. Hence, for Kant, the goal of science was to secure useful information, whereas for Plato science secured truth.

Unfortunately, Jurkevich's style prevented a greater dissemination of his views. In his own day, his unfashionable views, cloaked as they were in scholastic language with frequent allusions to scripture, hardly endeared him to a young, secular audience. Jurkevich remained largely a figure of derision at the university. Today, it is these same qualities, together with his failure to elucidate his argument in distinctly rational terms, that make studying his writings both laborious and unsatisfying. In terms of immediate impact, he had only one student—V.Solovyov (see below). Yet, notwithstanding his meager direct impact, Jurkevic's Christian Platonism proved deeply influential until at least the Bolshevik Revolution of 1917.

Unlike Jurkevich, P. Lavrov (1823-1900), a teacher of mathematics at the Petersburg Military Academy, actively aspired to a university chair in philosophy (namely, the one in the capital when the position was restored in the early 1860s). However, the government apparently already suspected Lavrov of questionable allegiance and, despite a recommendation from a widely respected scholar (K. Kavelin), awarded the position instead to Sidonsky.

In a series of lengthy essays written when he had university aspirations, Lavrov developed a position, which he termed "anthropologism," that opposed metaphysical speculation, including the then-fashionable materialism of left-wing radicalism. Instead, he defended a simple epistemological phenomenalism that at many points bore a certain similarity to Kant's position, though without the latter's intricacies, nuances, and rigor. Essentially, Lavrov maintained that all claims regarding objects are translatable into statements about appearances or an aggregate of them. Additionally, he held that we have a collection of convictions concerning the external world, convictions whose basis lies in repeated experiential encounters with similar appearances. The indubitability of consciousness and our irresistible conviction in the reality of the external world are fundamental and irreducible. The error of both materialism and idealism, fundamentally, is the mistaken attempt to collapse one into the other. Since both are fundamental, the attempt to prove either is ill-conceived from the outset. Consistent with this skepticism, Lavrov argued that the study of "phenomena of consciousness," a "phenomenology of spirit," could be raised to a science only through introspection, a method he called "subjective." Likewise, the natural sciences, built on our firm belief in the external world, need little support from philosophy. To question the law of causality, for example, is, in effect, to undermine the scientific standpoint.

Parallel to the two principles of theoretical philosophy, Lavrov spoke of two principles underlying practical philosophy. The first is that the individual is consciously free in his worldly activity. Unlike for Kant, however, this principle is not a postulate but a phenomenal fact; it carries no theoretical implications. For Lavrov, the moral sphere is quite autonomous from the theoretical. The second principle is that of "ideal creation." Just as in the theoretical sphere we set ourselves against a real world, so in the practical sphere we set ourselves against ideals. Just as the real world is the source of knowledge, the world of our ideals serves as the motivation for action. In turning our own image of ourselves into an ideal, we create an ideal of personal dignity. Initially, the human individual conceives dignity along egoistic lines. In time, however, the individual's interaction, including competition, with others gives rise to his conception of them as having equal claims to dignity and to rights. In linking rights to human dignity, Lavrov thereby denied that animals have rights.

Of a similar intellectual bent, N. Mikhailovsky (1842-1904) was even more of a popular writer than Lavrov. Nevertheless, Mikhailovsky's importance in the history of Russian philosophy lies in his defense of the role of subjectivity in human studies. Unlike the natural sciences, the aim of which is the discovery of objective laws, the human sciences, according to Mikhailovsky, must take into account the epistemologically irreducible fact of conscious, goal-oriented activity. While not disclaiming the importance of objective laws, both Lavrov and Mikhailovsky held that social scientists must introduce a subjective, moral evaluation into their analyses. Unlike natural scientists, social scientists recognize the malleability of the laws under their investigation.

Comtean positivism, which for quite some years enjoyed considerable attention in 19th century Russia, found its most resolute and philosophically notable defender in V. Lesevich (1837-1905). Finding that it lacked a scientific grounding, Lesevich believed that positivism needed an inquiry into the principles that guide the attainment of knowledge. Such an inquiry must take for granted some body of knowledge without simply identifying itself with it. To the now-classic Hegelian charge that such a procedure amounted to not venturing into the water before learning how to swim, Lesevich replied that what was sought was not, so to speak, how to swim but, rather, the conditions that make swimming possible. In this vein, he consciously turned to the Kantian model while remaining highly critical of any talk of the a priori. In the end, Lesevich drew heavily upon psychology and empiricism for establishing the conditions of knowledge, thus leaving himself open to the charge of psychologism and relativism.

As the years passed, Lesevich moved from his early "critical realism," which abhorred metaphysical speculation, to an appreciation for the positivism of Richard Avenarius and Ernst Mach. However, this very abhorrence, which was decidedly unfashionable, as well as his political involvement somewhat limited his influence.

Undoubtedly, of the philosophical figures to emerge in the 1870s, indeed arguably in any decade, the greatest was Vladimir Solovyov (1853-1900). In fact, if we view philosophy not as an abstract, independent inquiry but as a more or less sustained intellectual conversation, then we can precisely date the start of Russian secular philosophy: 24 November 1874, the day of Solovyov's defense of his magister's dissertation, Krizis zapadnoj filosofii (The Crisis of Western Philosophy). For only from that day forward do we find a sustained discussion within Russia of philosophical issues considered on their own terms, that is, without overt appeal to their extra-philosophical ramifications, such as their religious or political implications.

After completion and defense of his magister's dissertation, Solovyov penned a highly metaphysical treatise entitled "Filosofskie nachala tsel'nogo znanija" ("Philosophical Principles of Integral Knowledge"), which he never completed. However, at approximately the same time, he also worked on what became his doctoral dissertation, Kritika otvlechennykh nachal (Critique of Abstract Principles)—the very title suggesting a Kantian influence. Although originally intended to consist of three parts, one each covering ethics, epistemology, and aesthetics, the completed work omitted the latter. For more than a decade, Solovyov remained silent on philosophical questions, preferring instead to concentrate on topical issues. When his interest was rekindled in the 1890s in preparing a second edition of his Kritika, a recognition of a fundamental shift in his views led him to recast their systemization in the form of an entirely new work, Opravdanie dobra (The Justification of the Good). Presumably, he intended to follow up his ethical investigations with respective treatises on epistemology and aesthetics. Unfortunately, Solovyov died having completed only three brief chapters of the "Theoretical Philosophy."

Solovyov's most relentless philosophical critic was B. Chicherin (1828-1904), certainly one of the most remarkable and versatile figures in Russian intellectual history. Despite his sharp differences with Solovyov, Chicherin himself accepted a modified Hegelian standpoint in metaphysics. Although viewing all of existence as rational, the rational process embodied in existence unfolds "dialectically." Chicherin, however, parted with the traditional triadic schematization of the Hegelian dialectic, arguing that the first moment consists of an initial unity of the one and the many. The second and third moments, paths, or steps are antithetical and take various forms in different spheres, such as matter and reason or universal and particular. The final moment is a fusion of the two into a higher unity.

In the social and ethical realm, Chicherin placed great emphasis on individual human freedom. Social and political laws should strive for moral neutrality, permitting the flowering of individual self-determination. In this way, he remained a staunch advocate of economic liberalism, seeing essentially no role for government intervention. The government itself had no right to use its powers either to aim at a moral ideal or to force its citizens to seek an ideal. On the other hand, the government should not use its powers to prevent the citizenry from the exercise of private morality. Despite receiving less treatment than the negative conception of freedom, Chicherin nevertheless upheld the idealist conception of positive freedom as the striving for moral perfection and, in this way, reaching the Absolute.

Another figure to emerge in the late 1870s and 1880s was the neo-Leibnizian A. Kozlov (1831- 1901), who taught at Kiev University and who called his highly developed metaphysical stance "panpsychism." As part of this stance, he, in contrast to Hume, argued for the substantial unity of the Self or I, which makes experience possible. This unity he held to be an obvious fact. Additionally, rejecting the independent existence of space and time, Kozlov held that they possessed being only in relation to thinking and sensing creatures. Like Augustine, however, Kozlov believed that God viewed time as a whole without our divisions into past, present, and future. To substantiate space and time, to attribute an objective existence to either, demands an answer to where and when to place them. Indeed, the very formulation of the problem presupposes a relation between a substantiated space or time and ourselves. Lastly, unlike Kant, Kozlov thought all judgments are analytic.

An unfortunately largely neglected figure to emerge in this period was M. Karinsky (1840- 1917), who taught philosophy at the St. Petersburg Ecclesiastic Academy. Unlike many of his contemporaries, Karinsky devoted much of his attention to logic and an analysis of arguments in Western philosophy, rather than metaphysical speculation. Unlike his contemporaries, Karinsky came to philosophy with an analytical bent rather than with a literary flair—a fact that made his writing style often decidedly torturous. True to those schooled in the Aristotleian tradition, Karinsky, like Brentano (to whom he has been compared) held that German Idealism was essentially irrationalist. Arguing against Kant, Karinsky believed that our inner states are not merely phenomenal, that the reflective self is not an appearance. Inner experience, unlike outer, yields no distinction between reality and appearance. In his general epistemology, Karinsky argued that knowledge was built on judgments, which were legitimate conclusions from premises. Knowledge, however, could be traced back to a set of ultimate unprovable, yet reliable, truths, which he called "self-evident." Karinsky argued for a pragmatic interpretation of realism, saying that something exists in another room unperceived by me means I would perceive it if I were to go into that room. Additionally, he accepted an analogical argument for the existence of other minds similar to that of John Stuart Mill and Bertrand Russell.

In his two-volume magnum opus Polozhitel'nye zadachi filosofii (The Positive Tasks of Philosophy), L. Lopatin (1855-1920), who taught at Moscow University, defended the possibility of metaphysical knowledge. He claimed that empirical knowledge is limited to appearances, whereas metaphysics yields knowledge of the true nature of things. Although Lopatin saw Hegel and Spinoza as the definitive expositors of rationalistic idealism, he rejected both for their very transformation of concrete relations into rational or logical ones. Nevertheless, Lopatin affirmed the role of reason particularly in philosophy in conscious opposition to, as he saw it, Solovyov's ultimate surrender to religion. In the first volume, he attacked materialism as itself a metaphysical doctrine that elevates matter to the status of an absolute that cannot explain the particular properties of individual things or the relation between things and consciousness. In his second volume, Lopatin distinguishes mechanical causality from "creative causality," according to which one phenomenon follows another, though with something new added to it. Despite his wealth of metaphysical speculation, quite foreign to most contemporary readers, Lopatin's observations on the self or ego derived from speculation that is not without some interest. Denying that the self has a purely empirical nature, Lopatin emphasized that the undeniable reality of time demonstrated the non-temporality of the self, for temporality could only be understood by that which is outside time. Since the self is extra-temporal, it cannot be destroyed, for that is an event in time. Likewise, in opposition to Solovyov, Lopatin held that the substantiality of the self is immediately evident in consciousness.

In the waning years of the 19th century, neo-Kantianism came to dominate German philosophy. Because of the increasing tendency to send young Russian graduate students to Germany for additional training, it should come as no surprise that that movement gained a foothold in Russia too. In one of the very few Russian works devoted to philosophy of science A. Vvedensky (1856-1925) presented, in his lengthy dissertation, a highly idealistic Kantian interpretation of the concept of matter as understood in the physics of his day. He tried therein to defend and update Kant's own work as exemplified in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science. Vvedensky's book, however, attracted little attention and exerted even less influence. Much more widely recognized were his own attempts in subsequent years, while teaching at St. Petersburg University, to recast Kant's transcendental idealism in, what he called, "logicism." Without drawing any conclusions based upon the nature of space and time, Vvedensky believed it possible to prove the impossibility of metaphysical knowledge and, as a corollary so to speak, that everything we know, including our own self, is merely an appearance, not a thing in itself. Vvedensky was also willing to cede that the time and the space in which we experience everything in the world are also phenomenal. Although metaphysical knowledge is impossible, metaphysical hypotheses, being likewise irrefutable, can be brought into a world-view based on faith. Particularly useful are those demanded by our moral tenets such as the existence of other minds.

The next two decades saw a blossoming of academic philosophy on a scale hardly imaginable just a short time earlier. Most fashionable Western philosophies of the time found adherents within the increasingly professional Russian scene. Even Friedrich Nietzsche's thought began to make inroads, particularly among certain segments of the artistic community and among the growing number of political radicals. Nonetheless, few, particularly during these formative years, adopted any Western system without significant qualifications. Even those who were most receptive to foreign ideas adapted them in line with traditional Russian concerns, interests, and attitudes. One of these traditional concerns was with Platonism in general. Some of Plato's dialogues appeared in a Masonic journal as early as 1777, and we can easily discern an interest in Plato's ideas as far back as the medieval period. Possibly the Catholic assimilation of Aristotelianism had something to do with the Russian Orthodox Church's emphasis on Plato. And again possibly this interest in Plato had something to do with the metaphysical and idealistic character of much classic Russian thought as against the decidedly more empirical character of many Western philosophies. We have already noted the Christian Platonism of Jurkevich, and his student Solovyov, who with his central concept of "vseedinstvo" ("total-unity") can, in turn, also be seen as a modern neo-Platonist.

In the immediate decades preceding the Bolshevik Revolution of 1917, a veritable legion of philosophers worked in Solovyov's wide shadow. Among the most prominent of these was S. Trubetskoi (1862-1905). The Platonic strain of his thought is evident in the very topics Trubetskoi chose for his magister's and doctoral theses: Metaphysics in Ancient Greece, 1890 and The History of the Doctrine of Logos, 1900, respectively. It is, however, in his programmatic essays "O prirode chelovecheskovo soznanija" ("The Nature of Human Consciousness"), 1889-1891 and "Osnovanija idealizma" ("The Foundations of Idealism"), 1896 that Trubetskoi elaborated his position with regard to modern philosophy. Holding that the basic problem of contemporary philosophy is whether human knowledge is of a personal nature, Trubetskoi maintained that modern Western philosophers relate personal knowledge to a personal consciousness. Herein lies their error. Human consciousness is not an individual consciousness, but, rather, an on-going universal process. Likewise, this process is a manifestation not of a personal mind but of a cosmic one. Personal consciousness, as he puts it, presupposes a collective consciousness, and the latter presupposes an absolute consciousness. Kant's great error was in conceiving the transcendental consciousness as subjective. In the second of the essays mentioned above, Trubetskoi claims that there are three means of knowing reality: empirically through the senses, rationally through thought, and directly through faith. For him, faith is what convinces us that there is an external world, a world independent of my subjective consciousness. It is faith that underlies our accepting the information provided by our sense organs as reliable. Moreover, it is faith that leads me to think there are in the world other beings with a mental organization and capacity similar to mine. However, Trubetskoi rejects equating his notion of faith with the passive "intellectual intuition" of Schelling and Solovyov. For Trubetskoi, faith is intimately connected with the will, which is the basis of my individuality. My discovery of the other is grounded in my desire to reach out beyond myself, that is, to love.

Although generally characterized as a neo-Leibnizian, N. Lossky (1870-1965) was also greatly influenced by a host of Russian thinkers including Solovyov and Kozlov. In addition to his own views, Lossky, having studied at Bern and Goettingen among other places, is remembered for his pioneering studies of contemporary German philosophy. He referred to Edmund Husserl's Logical Investigations already as early as 1906, and in 1911 he gave a course on Husserl's "intentionalism." Despite this early interest in strict epistemological problems, Lossky in general drew ever closer to the ontological concerns and positions of Russian Orthodoxy. He termed his epistemological views "intuitivism," believing that the cognitive subject apprehends the external world as it is in itself directly. Nevertheless, the object of cognition remains ontologically transcendent, while epistemologically immanent. This direct penetration into reality is possible, Lossky tells us, because all worldly entities are interconnected into an "organic whole." Additionally, all sensory properties of an object (for example, its color, texture, temperature, and so on) are actual properties of the object, our sense stimulation serving merely to direct our mental attention to those properties. That different people see one object in different ways is explained as a result of different ways individuals have of getting their attention directly towards one of the object's numerous properties. All entities, events, and relations that lack a temporal and spatial character possess "ideal being" and are the objects of "intellectual intuition." Yet, there is another, a third, realm of being that transcends the laws of logic (here we see the influence of Lossky's teacher, Vvedensky), which he calls "metalogical being" and is the object of mystical intuition.

Another kindred spirit was S. Frank (1877-1950), who in his early adult years was involved with Marxism and political activities. His magister's thesis Predmet znanija (The Object of Knowledge), 1915, is notable as much for its masterful handling of current Western philosophy as for its overall metaphysical position. Demonstrating a grasp not only of German neo-Kantianism, Frank drew freely from, among many others, Husserl, Henri-Louis Bergson, and Max Scheler; he may even have been the first in Russian to refer to Gottlob Frege, whose Foundations of Arithmetic Frank calls "one of the rare genuinely philosophical works by a mathematician." Frank contends that all logically determined objects are possible thanks to a metalogical unity, which is itself not subject to the laws of logic. Likewise, all logical knowledge is possible thanks solely to an "intuition," an "integral intuition," of this unity. Such intuition is possible because all of us are part of this unity or Absolute. In a subsequent book Nepostizhimoe (The Unknowable), 1939, Frank further elaborated his view stating that mystical experience reveals the supra-logical sphere in which we are immersed but which cannot be conceptually described. Although there is a great deal more to Frank's thought, we see that we are quickly leaving behind the secular, philosophical sphere for the religious, if not mystical.

No survey, however brief, of Russian thinkers under Solovyov's influence would be satisfactory without mention of the best known of these in the West, namely N. Berdjaev (1874-1948). Widely hailed as a Christian existentialist, he began his intellectual journey as a Marxist. However, by the time of his first publications he was attempting to unite a revolutionary political outlook with transcendental idealism, particularly a Kantian ethic. Within the next few years, Berdjaev's thought evolved quickly and decisively away from Marxism and away from critical idealism to an outright Orthodox Christian idealism. On the issue of free will versus determinism, Berdjaev moved from an initial acceptance of soft determinism to a resolute incompatibilist. Morality, he claimed, demanded his stand. Certainly, Berdjaev was among the first, if not the first, philosopher of his era to diminish the importance of epistemology in place of ontology. In time, however, he himself made clear that the pivot of his thought was not the concept of Being, as it would be for some others, and even less that of knowledge, but, rather, the concept of freedom. Acknowledging his debt to Kant, Berdjaev too saw science as providing knowledge of phenomenal reality but not of actuality, of things as they are in themselves. However applicable the categories of logic and physics may be to appearances, they are assuredly inapplicable to the noumenal world and, in particular, to God. In this way Berdjaev does not object to the neo-Kantianism of Vvedensky, for whom the objectification of the world is a result of functioning of the human cognitive apparatus, but only that it does not go far enough. There is another world or realm, namely one characterized by freedom.

Just as all of the above figures drew inspiration from Christian neo-Platonism, so too did they all feel the need to address the Kantian heritage. Lossky's dissertation Obosnovanie intuitivizma (The Foundations of Intuitivism), for example, is an extended engagement with Kant's epistemology, Lossky himself having prepared a Russian translation of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason comparable in style and adequacy to Norman Kemp Smith's famous rendering into English. Trubetskoi called Kant the "Copernicus of modern philosophy," who "discovered that there is an a priori precondition of all possible experience." Nevertheless, among the philosophers of this era, not all saw transcendental idealism as a springboard to religious and mystical thought. A student of Vvedensky's, I. Lapshin (1870-1952) in his dissertation, Zakony myshlenija i formy poznanija (The Laws of Thought and the Forms of Cognition), 1906, attempted to show that, contrary to Kant's stand, space and time were categories of cognition and that all thought, even logical, relies on a categorical synthesis. Consequently, the laws of logic are themselves synthetic, not analytic, as Kant had thought and are applicable only within the bounds of possible experience.

G. Chelpanov (1863-1936), who taught at Moscow University, was another with a broadly conceived Kantian stripe. Remembered as much, if not more so, for his work in experimental psychology as in philosophy, Chelpanov, unlike many others, wished to retain the concept of the thing-in-itself, seeing it as that which ultimately "evokes" a particular representation of an object. Without it, contended Chelpanov, we are left (as in Kant) without an explanation of why we perceive this, and not that, particular object. In much the same manner, we must appeal to some transcendent space in order to account for why we see an object in this spot and not another. For these reasons, Chelpanov called his position "critical realism" as opposed to the more usual construal of Kantianism as "transcendental idealism." In psychology, Chelpanov upheld the psychophysical parallelism of Wilhelm Wundt.

As the years of the First World War approached, a new generation of scholars came to the fore who returned to Russia from graduate work in Germany broadly sympathetic to one or even an amalgam of the schools of neo-Kantianism. Among these young scholars, the works of B. Kistjakovsky (1868-1920) and P. Novgorodtsev (1866-1924) stand out as arguably the most accessible today for their analytic approach to questions of social-science methodology.

During this period, Husserlian phenomenology was introduced into Russia from a number of sources, but its first and, in a sense, only major propagandist was G. Shpet (1879-1937), whom we have referred to earlier. In any case, besides his historical studies Shpet did pioneering work in hermeneutics as early as 1918. Additionally, in two memorable essays he respectively argued, along the lines of the early Husserl and the late Solovyov, against the Husserlian view of the transcendental ego and in the other traced the Husserlian notion of philosophy as a rigorous science back to Parmenides.

Regrettably, Shpet was permanently silenced during the Stalinist era, but A. Losev (1893-1988), whose early works fruitfully employed some early phenomenological techniques, survived and blossomed in its aftermath. Concentrating on ancient Greek thought, particularly aesthetics, his numerous publications have yet to be assimilated into world literature, although during later years his enormous contributions were recognized within his homeland and by others to whom they were linguistically accessible. It must be said, nonetheless, that Losev's personal pronouncements hark back to a neo-Platonism completely at odds with the modern temperament.

d. The Soviet Era (1917-1991)

The Bolshevik Revolution of 1917 ushered in a political regime with a set ideology that countenanced no intellectual competition. During the first few years of its existence, Bolshevik attention was directed towards consolidating political power, and the selection of university personnel in many cases was left an internal matter. In 1922, however, most explicitly non-Marxist philosophers who had not already fled were banished from the country. Many of them found employment, at least for a time, in the major cities of Europe and continued their personal intellectual agendas. None of them, however, during their lifetimes significantly influenced philosophical developments either in their homeland or in the West, and few, with the notable exception of Berdyaev, received wide recognition.

During the first decade of Bolshevik rule, the consuming philosophical question concerned the role of Marxism with regard to traditional academic disciplines, particularly those that had either emerged since Karl Marx's death or had seen recent breathtaking developments that had reshaped the field. The best known dispute occurred between the "mechanists" and the "dialecticians" or "Deborinists," after its principal advocate A. Deborin (1881-1963). Since a number of individuals composed both groups and the issues in dispute evolved over time, no simple statement of the respective stances can do complete justice to either. Nevertheless, the mechanists essentially held that philosophy as a separate discipline had no reason for being within the Soviet state. All philosophical problems could and would be resolved by the natural sciences. The hallowed dialectical method of Marxism was, in fact, just the scientific method. The Deborinists, on the other hand, defended the existence of philosophy as a separate discipline. Indeed, they viewed the natural sciences as built on a set of philosophical principles. Unlike the mechanists, they saw nature as fundamentally dialectical, which could not be reduced to simpler mechanical terms. Even human history and society proceeded dialectically in taking leaps that resulted in qualitatively different states. The specifics of the controversy, which raged until 1929, are of marginal philosophical importance now, but to some degree the basic issue of the relation of philosophy to the sciences, of the role of the former with regard to the latter, endures to this day. Regrettably, politics played as much of a role in the course of the dispute as abstract reasoning, and the outcome was a simple matter of a political fiat with the Deborinists gaining a temporary victory. Subsequent events over the next two decades, such as the defeat of the Deborinists, have nothing to do with philosophy. What philosophy did continue to be pursued during these years within Russia was kept a personal secret, any disclosure of which was at the expense of one's life. To a certain degree, the issue of the role of philosophy arose again in the 1950s when the philosophical implications of relativity theory became a disputed subject. Again, the issue arose of whether philosophy or science had priority. This time, however, with atomic weapons securely in hand there could be no doubt as to the ultimate victor with little need for political intervention.

Another controversy, though less vociferous, concerned psychological methodology and the very retention of such common terms as "consciousness," "psyche," and "attention." The introspective method, as we saw advocated by many of the idealistic philosophers, was seen by the new ideologues as subjective and unscientific in that it manifestly referred to private phenomena. I. Pavlov (1849-1936), already a star of Russian science at the time of the Revolution, was quickly seen as utilizing a method that subjected psychic activity to the objective methods of the natural sciences. The issue became, however, whether the use of objective methods would eliminate the need to invoke such traditional terms as "consciousness." The central figure here was V. Bekhterev (1857-1927), who believed that since all mental processes eventually manifested themselves in objectively observable behavior, subjective terminology was superfluous. Again, the discussion was silenced through political means once a victory was secured over the introspectionists. Bekhterev's behaviorism was itself found to be dangerously leftist.

As noted above, during the 1930s and '40s, independent philosophizing virtually ceased to exist, and what little was published is of no more than historical interest. Indicative of the condition of Russian thought at this time is the fact that when in 1946 the government decided to introduce logic into the curriculum of secondary schools the only suitable text available was a slim book by Chelpanov dating from before the Revolution. After Joseph Stalin's death, a relative relaxation or "thaw" in the harsh intellectual climate was permitted, of course within the strict bounds of the official state ideology. In addition to the re-surfacing of the old issue of the role of Marxism with respect to the natural sciences, Russian scholars sought a return to the traditional texts in hopes of understanding the original inspiration of the official philosophy. Some, such as the young A. Zinoviev (1922-2006) sought an understanding of "dialectical logic" in terms of the operations, procedures and techniques employed in political economics. Others, for example, V. Tugarinov, drew heavily on Hegel's example in attempting to delineate a system of fundamental categories.

After the formal recognition in the validity of formal logic, it received significant attention in the ensuing years by Zinoviev, D. Gorsky, and E. Voishvillo, among many others. Their works have deservedly received international attention and made no use of the official ideology. What sense, if any, to make of "dialectical logic" was another matter that could not remain politically neutral. Until the last days of the Soviet period, there was no consensus as to what it is or its relation to formal logic. One of the most resolute defenders of dialectical logic was E. Ilyenkov, who has received attention even in the West. In epistemology too, surface agreement, demonstrated through use of an official vocabulary obscured (but did not quite hide) differences of opinion concerning precisely how to construe the official stand. It certainly now appears that little of enduring worth in this field was published during the Soviet years. However, some philosophers who were active at that time produced works that only recently have been published. Perhaps the most striking example is M. Mamardashvili (1930-1990), who during his lifetime was noted for his deep interest in the history of philosophy and his anti-Hegelian stands.

Most work in ethics in the Soviet period took a crude apologetic form of service to the state. In essence, the good is that which promotes the stated goals of Soviet society. Against such a backdrop, Ja. Mil'ner-Irinin's study Etika ili printsy istinnoj chelovechnosti (Ethics or The Principles of a True Humanity) is all the more remarkable. Although only an excerpt appeared in print in the 1960s, the book-length manuscript, which as a whole was rejected for publication, was circulated and discussed. The author presented a normative system that he held to be universally valid and timeless. Harking back to the early days of German Idealism, Mil'ner-Irinin urged being true to one's conscience as a moral principle. However, he claimed he deduced his deontology from human social nature rather than from the idea of rationality (as in Kant).

After the accession of L. Brezhnev to the position of General Secretary and particularly after the events that curtailed the Prague Spring in 1968, all signs of independent philosophizing beat a speedy retreat. The government anxiously launched a campaign for ideological vigilance, which a German scholar, H. Dahm, termed an "ideological counter-reformation," that persisted until the "perestroika" of the Gorbachev years.

e. The Post-Soviet Era (1991-)

Clearly, the dissolution of the Soviet Union and the relegation of the Communist Party to the political opposition has also ushered in a new era in the history of Russian philosophy. What trends will emerge is still too early to tell. How Russian philosophers will eventually evaluate their own recent, as well as tsarist, past may turn to a large degree on the country's political and economic fortunes. Not surprisingly, the 1990s saw, in particular, a "re-discovery" of the previously forbidden works of the religious philosophers active just prior to or at the time of the Bolshevik Revolution. Whether Russian philosophers will continue along these lines or approach a style resembling Western "analytical" trends remains an open question.

3. Concluding Remarks

In the above historical survey we have emphasized Russian epistemological over ontological and ethical concerns, hopefully without neglecting or disparaging them. Admittedly, doing so may reflect a certain "Western bias." Nevertheless, such a survey, whatever its deficiencies, shows that questions regarding the possibility of knowledge have never been completely foreign to the Russian mind. This we can unequivocally state without dismissing Masaryk's position, for indeed during the immediate decades preceding the 1917 Revolution epistemology was not accorded special attention, let alone priority. Certainly at the time when Masaryk formulated his position, Russian philosophy was relatively young. Nonetheless, were the non-critical features of Russian philosophy, which Masaryk so correctly observed, a reflection of the Russian mind as such or were they a reflection of the era observed? If one were to view 19th century German philosophy from the rise of Hegelianism to the emergence of neo-Kantianism, would one not see it as shortchanging epistemology? Could it not be that our error lay in focussing on a single period in Russian history, albeit the philosophically most fruitful one? In any case, the mere existence of divergent opinions during the Soviet era—however cautiously these had to be expressed—on recurring fundamental questions testifies to the tenacity of philosophy on the human mind.

Rather than ask for the general characteristics of Russian philosophy, should we not ask why philosophy arose so late in Russia compared to other nations? Was Vvedensky correct that the country lacked suitable educational institutions until relatively recently, or was he writing as a university professor who saw no viable alternative to make a living? Could it be that Shpet was right in thinking that no one found any utilitarian value in philosophy except in modest service to theology, or was he merely expressing his own fears for the future of philosophy in an overtly ideological state? Did Masaryk have grounds for linking the late emergence of philosophy in Russia to the perceived anti-intellectualism of Orthodox theology, or was he simply speaking as a Unitarian. Finally, intriguing as this question may be, are we not in searching for an answer guilty of what some would label the mistake of reductionism, that is, of trying to resolve a philosophical problem by appeal to non-philosophical means?

4. References and Further Reading

Secondary works in Western languages:

  • Copleston, Frederick C. Philosophy in Russia, From Herzen to Lenin and Berdyaev, Notre Dame, 1986.
  • Dahm, Helmut. Der gescheiterte Ausbruch: Entideologisierung und ideologische Gegenreformation in Osteuropa (1960-1980), Baden-Baden, 1982.
  • DeGeorge, Richard T. Patterns of Soviet Thought, Ann Arbor, 1966.
  • Goerdt, W. Russische Philosophie: Zugaenge und Durchblicke, Freiburg/Muenchen, 1984.
  • Joravsky, David. Soviet Marxism and Natural Science 1917-1932, NY, 1960.
  • Koyre, Alexandre. La philosophie et le probleme national en Russie au debut du XIXe siecle, Paris, 1929.
  • Lossky, Nicholas O. History of Russian Philosophy, New York, 1972.
  • Masaryk, Thomas Garrigue. The Spirit of Russia, trans. Eden & Cedar Paul, NY, 1955.
  • Scanlan, James P. Marxism in the USSR, A Critical Survey of Current Soviet Thought, Ithaca, 1985
  • Walicki, Andrzej. A History of Russian Thought from the Enlightenment to Marxism, Stanford, 1979.
  • Zenkovsky, V. V. A History of Russian Philosophy, trans. George L. Kline, London, 1967.

Author Information

Thomas Nemeth
U. S. A.

Comparative Philosophy

Comparative philosophy—sometimes called "cross-cultural philosophy"—is a subfield of philosophy in which philosophers work on problems by intentionally setting into dialogue sources from across cultural, linguistic, and philosophical streams. The ambition and challenge of comparative philosophy is to include all the philosophies of global humanity in its vision of what is constituted by philosophy.

This approach distinguishes comparative philosophy from several other approaches to philosophy. First, comparative philosophy is distinct from both area studies philosophy (in which philosophers investigate topics in particular cultural traditions, for example, Confucianism) and world philosophy (in which philosophers construct a philosophical system based on the fullness of global traditions of thought). Second, comparative philosophy differs from more traditional philosophy in which ideas are compared among thinkers within a particular tradition; comparative philosophy intentionally compares the ideas of thinkers of very different traditions, especially culturally distinct traditions.

With the unique approach of comparative philosophy also comes unique difficulties and challenges that are not as characteristic of doing philosophy within a particular tradition. Such difficulties to be avoided include descriptive chauvinism (recreating another tradition in the image of one’s own), normative skepticism (merely narrating or describing the views of different philosophers and traditions, suspending all judgment about their adequacy), incommensurability (the inability to find the common ground among traditions needed as a basis for comparison), and perennialism (failure to realize that philosophical traditions evolve, that they are not perennial in the sense of being monolithic or static). Furthermore, since comparative philosophy involves an approach that is not dominant in academic philosophy, it has been somewhat neglected by the mainstream of the profession. However, comparative philosophy is fairly early in its developmental stages.

Table of Contents

  1. What is Comparative Philosophy?
  2. Historical Development of Comparative Philosophy
  3. Some Difficulties Facing the Comparative Philosopher
    1. Chauvinism
    2. Skepticism
    3. Incommensurability
    4. Perennialism
  4. Prospects for Comparative Philosophy
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Comparative Philosophy – General
    2. Comparative Philosophy – Chinese-Western
    3. Comparative Philosophy – Indian-Western
    4. Comparative Philosophy – Japanese-Western
    5. Comparative Philosophy – Other

1. What is Comparative Philosophy?

Comparative philosophy—sometimes called cross-cultural philosophy—is a subfield of philosophy in which philosophers work on problems by intentionally setting into dialogue sources from across cultural, linguistic, and philosophical streams. Comparative philosophers most frequently engage topics in dialogue between modern Western (for example, American and Continental European) and Classical Asian (for example, Chinese, Indian, or Japanese) traditions, but work has been done using materials and approaches from Islamic and African philosophical traditions as well as from classical Western traditions (for example, Judaism, Christianity, Platonism).

It is important to distinguish comparative philosophy from both area studies philosophy and world philosophy. Unlike comparative philosophy, in area studies philosophy, the focus is on a single region. Chinese philosophy, Indian philosophy, and African philosophy are examples of area studies philosophy fields, in which the work done need not be comparative. Area studies philosophers do not necessarily compare the texts and thinkers with which they work with any ideas outside of the circumscribed area. For example, Chinese philosophers may study Confucius, various forms of Confucianism, criticisms of Confucianism in Chinese Daoism and Buddhism, and even Confucianism in the contemporary world, but they need not make any attempt to compare Confucian thought with philosophical texts and thinkers from other cultures. (For this reason, the bibliography to the present entry does not have categories that fit area studies philosophy rather than comparative philosophy.)

World philosophy, like area studies philosophy, should be distinguished from comparative philosophy. World philosophy may be thought of as an effort at constructive philosophy that takes into account the great variety of philosophical writings and traditions across human cultures and endeavors to weave them into a coherent world view. As such, it is an extension of comparative philosophy, because comparison is fundamental to the constructivist task. But comparative philosophy need not become world philosophy. The comparative philosopher may be working on isolated topics, or with two or more philosophers, just for the sake of gaining clarity on some specific issue. Likewise, those wanting to construct a world philosophy often find a place for the thought of other traditions in the system they construct, but it is fair to wonder whether they really allow the voice of the other to express itself in its strongest form.

2. Historical Development of Comparative Philosophy

Comparative philosophy as cross-cultural philosophy is a relative newcomer to the field of philosophy. It has its antecedents in the Western awareness of different traditions, especially Asian ones, in the eighteenth century. Much of the work done during this period and just afterward does not conform to the definition of comparative philosophy outlined above. As Jonathan Spence (1998) has pointed out, the earliest treatments of China by Western philosophers, such as that of Hegel, really cannot properly be called comparative philosophy because they lack any serious engagement from the Chinese side.

The story is quite different in Asia, where cultural traditions mingled and clashed with considerably more frequency than in the relatively provincial West. For instance, the spread of Buddhism into China from India and central Asia beginning in the first few centuries CE sparked a long tradition of philosophical reaction to its “foreign” ideas from Confucian and Daoist intellectuals—much of it hostile, some of it appreciative and appropriating, but all of it at least implicitly comparative. The story of Chinese Buddhism over the next two millennia is very much the story of the dialogue between and among foreign and indigenous traditions, as is the story of Confucianism and Daoism during the same period. Similar patterns of dialogue between indigenous traditions and Buddhism are found in Korea, Japan, Sri Lanka, Thailand and Vietnam; parallel patterns may be identified among other players in India. It is, perhaps, because of this long familiarity with cross-cultural dialogue and the willingness to take one’s partners seriously that many of the earliest works comparing Eastern and Western philosophies that are still important came not from Westerners but from non-Westerners responding to Western ideas. Sri Aurobindo (1872-1950) and Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (1888-1975) were perhaps the most prominent and influential voices responding from India in the early part of the last century, presenting Indian philosophical ideas and comparing, contrasting, and even fusing Eastern and Western philosophy and religion. In Japan, Nishida Kitaro’s An Inquiry into the Good (1911) initiated a creative, critical appropriation of Western philosophy and religion from a perspective anchored in Mahayana Buddhism that continues today in the work of members of the Kyoto School, most notably Keiji Nishitani and Masao Abe.

Partially as a result of the emergence of comparative studies in nineteenth-century Anglo-European intellectual history, the University of Hawaii sponsored the first in a sequence of East-West Philosophers’ Conferences in 1939. Since that time comparative philosophy, area studies philosophy, and world philosophy have continued to grow and cross fertilize each other. Nevertheless, comparative philosophy as a field is only now becoming fully self-conscious, methodologically and substantively, about its role and function in the larger enterprises of philosophy and area studies.

Mainstream Western philosophy has been slow to accept comparative philosophy. Philosophy departments rarely create space for it in their curricula, and comparative philosophers often find it difficult to publish their work in mainline journals. In November of 1996, comparative philosopher Bryan Van Norden wrote an “Open Letter to the APA.” Van Norden complained directly that philosophers writing on comparative subjects were being segregated out of the mainstream philosophical journals. Although Van Norden does not make it entirely clear in his letter, his complaint seems to be directed toward two ways in which scholars of comparative philosophy have been disenfranchised from mainstream journals in the past.

One way in which this has happened is that these scholars must go to area studies journals, such as those dealing with China, India, Asia, the Middle East, or Islam. Another way in which this has happened was that their comparative work was subsumed under area studies philosophy journals such as the Journal of Chinese Philosophy, African Philosophy, Journal of Indian Philosophy, Journal of Jewish Thought and Philosophy, Philosophy in Japan, or Asian Philosophy. The distinctively comparative journals still remain small in number: Philosophy East and West and Dao: A Journal in Comparative Philosophy (which has a restricted area of comparison).

Nevertheless, the Society of Asian and Comparative Philosophy now convenes its own sections in the annual meetings of the American Philosophical, the American Academy of Religion, and the Association of Asian Studies. The Association of Asian Studies also has published a monograph series featuring works in any area of Asian philosophy (or in any other field of philosophy examined from a comparative perspective) since 1974. Some presses, such as the State University of New York Press and Lexington Books also have specific book series devoted to topics in comparative philosophy. Examples of work in these series include Varieties of Ethical Reflection: New Directions for Ethics in a Global Context, edited by Michael Barnhart (2003) and Self as Person in Asian Thought, edited by Roger Ames, Wilmal Dissanayake, and Thomas Kasulis (1994).

Until very recently, most introductory philosophy courses focused exclusively on the Western tradition, indeed mainly on the Anglo-European classics and thinkers. But now there is a much wider variety of work available for introducing students to philosophy that is either explicitly comparative in itself, or that at least makes possible comparative philosophical work. (Some of these works are listed in the bibliography below.)

3. Some Difficulties Facing the Comparative Philosopher

a. Chauvinism

Martha Nussbaum (1997) warns against several kinds of vices that infect comparative analysis and some of the activities she cautions against may represent the kinds of methodological procedures or dispositions toward belief to which comparative philosophers might fall victim.

Descriptive chauvinism is that fault which consists in recreating the other tradition in the image of one’s own. This is reading a text from another tradition and assuming that it asks the same questions or constructs responses or answers in a similar manner as that one with which one is most familiar. For example, philosophers who read Confucius as a virtue ethicist on the model of Aristotle must be on constant guard against this kind of chauvinism. David Hall and Roger Ames (1995) have argued against translating the name of the Chinese text Zhongyong as The Doctrine of the Mean, because they do not think that it pursues the same kinds of virtue analysis in practical reason that Aristotle does in his Nicomachean Ethics.

On the opposite end, but still an example of a kind of chauvinistic vice, is what Nussbaum calls normative chauvinism. This is the tendency found in many philosophers to believe that their tradition is best and that insofar as the others are different, they are inferior or in error. Ideally, philosophers should hold those views that are most defensible and credible. But the criteria for making this decision may be tradition-dependent. So, if a philosopher is unwilling to revisit his own criteria in light of another tradition, he may find himself committed to little else other than a form of normative chauvinism. For example, finding that Zhuangzi’s antirationalism moves through quietude and stillness to effortless action might lead some philosophers to dismiss this approach because it does not employ the sorts of evidential standards one holds. A common form of normative chauvinism is the belief that unless philosophy is done in a certain kind of way (for example, ratiocinative argument), then it cannot properly be considered philosophy. Many philosophy departments in Europe, Britain, and America have never thought about including courses in comparative philosophy, or even area studies philosophies such as those from China, India, or Japan because these traditions are not perceived as doing “real philosophy.” Some comparative philosophers believe this is analogous to a person listening to Indian music, realizing that it sounds very different from Western music, and concluding that it is not “real music.” What gets overlooked in such cases is that, while the whole concept of a “philosophical work” or “musical work” often differs according to each tradition, each tradition-dependent example is intellectually robust and meaningful nonetheless.

b. Skepticism

Normative skepticism may not actually be considered a vice by some philosophers, even if Nussbaum names it as one. It consists of narrating the views of different philosophers and traditions and suspending all judgment about their adequacy. When teaching the history of Western philosophy, some philosophers never really offer any critical view that puts aside a thinker’s claims. But many philosophers hold that some views are less defensible than others, and some are just wrong. They believe this is not only true when considering thinkers within the history of Western philosophy, but also when doing cross-cultural comparative philosophy. While it is true that not all Western philosophy has it right, it is equally true that neither does any other tradition. Some Buddhist, Indian, Confucian, Daoist, and Islamic views should be challenged, and sometimes they will be found deficient either according to agreed-on cross-cultural standards, or because of some form of internal incoherence. Being a comparative philosopher does not entail an uncritical acceptance of the other traditions simply because they are different. It is not expressed in a kind of Romanticism that might think of some philosophical tradition from another culture as always right, or preferable to Western philosophy. Nor does comparative philosophy require a suspension of all critical judgment. Indeed, it is built on the fundamental premise that the conversation across traditions will burn away some dross and refine and confirm some truths. But because philosophical viewpoints sometimes differ so dramatically, it is not always obvious how one might show itself preferable to another on any philosophical grounds. Forming grounds for deciding among views is one of the fundamental tasks of comparative philosophy.

c. Incommensurability

David Wong (1989) has offered a view of the ways in which philosophical traditions may be incommensurable. One kind of incommensurability involves the inability to translate some concepts in one tradition into meaning and reference in some other tradition. A second sort is that some philosophical models differ from others in such fundamental ways as to make it impossible for the advocates to understand each other. Wong thinks that some forms of life may be so far from a person’s experience and philosophical tradition that she is unable to see the merits in another view. The third version of incommensurability is that the traditions differ on what counts as evidence and grounds for decidability, thus making it impossible to make a judgment between them. There is no common or objective decision criterion justifying the preference for one set of claims over another, much less one tradition in its entirety over another. Wong proposes learning about the other tradition as a remedy. The idea is that each philosopher infects the other with a way of seeing. So, the task is to come to an understanding of how the other philosophical tradition is tied to a life that humans have found satisfying and meaningful.

It is often the case that philosophers who realize that critical work must be a part of the comparative project go on to conclude that traditions should be seen as rivals. Alasdair MacIntyre (1991) has explored this very impasse. He thinks that once the comparative project has passed beyond the initial stage of partial incomprehension and partial misrepresentation of the other, and an accurate representation of the other emerges, then the task of showing which rival tradition is rationally superior to the other comes into view. The triumph of one tradition over another may be a result of one standpoint acknowledging, based on its own internal standards, that it is inferior to another viewpoint. And when the resources available for the corrections of these inadequacies are not present in their own tradition, then those persons holding the failed view may transfer their assent to the tradition that has those resources or which has provided an explanation for why the previously held system failed. MacIntyre thinks that this situation can occur even if the two traditions have no common or shared philosophical beliefs or methods; that is, even if they are totally incommensurable. In those situations in which comparative philosophers find themselves in rational debate with those of another tradition, MacIntyre says that each philosopher has a responsibility to see his own standpoint from as problematic a view as possible, admitting the possibility of fallibilism. But he also takes the view that in any comparison of views philosophically, we must be comparing from some standpoint. There is no neutral ground. This is what he means when he says that comparative philosophy eventually becomes the comparison of comparisons.

MacIntyre considers the question whether the comparative philosophical project is a matter of choosing, and even of rational debate. Raising an imaginary objection to his own views, he says, that if one accuses him of presupposing that conception of rational order that is characteristic of the West and not found in Chinese thought, then he simply must say that this is the standpoint from which he stands and he could not have done otherwise. This is a view of the comparative philosophical task, while describing the way in which some comparative philosophers work, is by no means true of them all. Many comparative philosophers (such as those listed in the bibliography below) typically do not think of their work as enabling a decision between rival theories in a rational way. They conceive of their work as a process of conversation in which philosophical progress is made and all the traditions are altered in the resulting narrative.

d. Perennialism

The difficulty of commensurability is not the only one facing comparative philosophers. A mistake made by many comparative philosophers is that they overlook that philosophical traditions have a present as well as a past. While the classical texts of various traditions are formative and become the basis for much of the distinct evolution of a tradition, a philosopher cannot focus only on them. As those who study any philosophical tradition in depth know very well, all philosophical traditions are evolving. They are not “perennial” in the sense of being monolithic or static. They not only have tensions with other traditions, but they contain internal conflict as well. The point at which a comparative philosopher steps into the stream of another tradition is always important. He must understand not only the reasons for why a particular view is held in another tradition, but also that it is only one view among others that are possible within that particular tradition. For example, if one wants to do comparative morality, focusing on Chinese moral culture, what should he study? The Confucian, the Daoist, the Buddhist, the Marxist critique of all three? And with what aspects of his own tradition will he compare Chinese moral culture? The deontological, the utilitarian, the Aristotelian?

4. Prospects for Comparative Philosophy

In the end, one may object that actually there is no such thing as comparative philosophy, as a discrete sub-discipline of philosophical work, because all philosophical work is comparative. After all, one thing philosophers habitually do is to compare the work of various thinkers with those of others, or with their own. Philosophers require a thorough survey of the full range of significant views on a question before giving assent. Each view must be tested against others. This is a characteristically comparative project. For example, if one sets Hume’s discussion of personal identity alongside of Locke’s, a comparison is made. It is not self-evident that there is really a difference in comparing Confucius’ views on morality and those of Aristotle, and those of Aquinas and Aristotle on the same subject. Furthermore, if one compares Descartes’ epistemology and truth theory to Hegel’s one is not only making a comparison, but some philosophers would say that the two approaches are so different from each other as to be incommensurable (that is, lacking any common basis for comparison). This means that not only is the task of comparison fundamental to what philosophers do, but also the thought worlds examined may be incommensurable even though they come from the same cultural stream. Descartes and Hegel may be incommensurable on truth in much the same way that Buddhism’s approach to the fundamental problem of humanity and how to handle it is unlike the way Pragmatism thinks of this problem.

One may take the position that Aristotle compared with Confucius on morality is different only in degree from a comparison between Aristotle and Aquinas. However, as Alfred North Whitehead pointed out, a difference in degree may sometimes become a difference in kind. Even if the difference between what philosophers regularly do when comparing thinkers within the Western tradition and what they do when comparing a Western thinker with one from India, for example, is not a matter of kind, still the degree of these differences might be important. But no formal or general rule or criteria can be laid down for distinguishing these types of comparisons. There are ways in which comparing philosophical ideas between traditions and comparing those within the same tradition are similar. Part of the task of comparative philosophers who work cross-culturally is to reveal, in the pursuit of their own work, wherein the differences between these comparative approaches are dramatic and philosophically significant.

Properly speaking, comparative philosophy does not lead toward the creation of a synthesis of philosophical traditions (as in world philosophy). What is being created is not a new theory but a different sort of philosopher. The goal of comparative philosophy is learning a new language, a new way of talking. The comparative philosopher does not so much inhabit both of the standpoints represented by the traditions from which he draws as he comes to inhabit an emerging standpoint different from them all and which is thereby creatively a new way of seeing the human condition.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Comparative Philosophy – General

  • Allen, Douglas, ed. Culture and Self: Philosophical and Religious Perspectives, East and West. Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 1997.
  • Ames, Roger, ed. The Aesthetic Turn: Reading Eliot Deutsch on Comparative Philosophy. Chicago: Open Court, 1999.
  • Ames, Roger and Wilmal Dissanayake. Self and Deception: A Cross Cultural Perspective. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1996.
  • Ames, Roger, Joel Marks, and Robert Solomon. Emotions in Asian Thought. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1995.
  • Ames, Roger, Wilmal Dissanayake, and Thomas Kasulis. Self as Image in Asian Theory and Practice. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1998.
  • Ames, Roger, Wilmal Dissanayake, and Thomas Kasulis. Self as Person in Asian Thought. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1994.
  • Ames, Roger, Wilmal Dissanayake, and Thomas Kasulis. Self as Body in Asian Theory and Practice. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1992.
  • Ames, Roger and J. Baird Callicott, eds. Nature in Asian Traditions of Thought: Essays in Environmental Philosophy. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1989.
  • Barnhart, Michael. Varieties of Ethical Reflection: New Directions in Ethics in a Global Context. Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2003.
  • Bonevac, Daniel and Stephen Phillips, eds. Understanding Non-Western Philosophy: Introductory Readings. Mountain View, CA: Mayfield Publishing, 1993.
  • Blocker, H. Gene. World Philosophy: An East-West Comparative Introduction to Philosophy. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Prentice Hall, 1999.
  • Carmody, Denise and John Carmody. Ways to the Center. 3rd ed. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth Publishing, 2001.
  • Clarke, J. J. Oriental Enlightenment: The Encounter Between Asian and Western Thought. London: Routledge, 1997.
  • Davidson, Donald. “On the Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme.” In Relativism: Cognitive and Moral, eds. Jack Meiland and Michael Krausz (Notre Dame: Notre Dame University Press, 1982): 66-81.
  • Deutsch, Eliot. Introduction to World Philosophies. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Prentice Hall, 1997.
  • Deutsch, Eliot and Ron Bontekoe, eds. A Companion to World Philosophies. Oxford: Blackwell, 1997.
  • Dilworth, David. Philosophy in World Perspective: A Comparative Hermeneutic of the Major Theories. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1989.
  • Fleischacker, Samuel. Integrity and Moral Relativism. Leiden: E. J. Brill, 1992.
  • Hackett, Stuart. Oriental Philosophy: A Westerner’s Guide to Eastern Thought. Madison: University of Wisconsin Press, 1979.
  • Hershock, Peter, Marietta Stepaniants and Roger Ames, eds. Technology and Cultural Values: On The Edge of the Third Millennium. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 2003.
  • Inada, Kenneth, ed. East-West Dialogues in Aesthetics. Buffalo: State University of New York at Buffalo, 1978.
  • Larson, Gerald James and Eliot Deutsch, eds. Interpreting Across Boundaries: New Essays in Comparative Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1988.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Incommensurability, Truth, and the Conversation Between Confucians and Aristotelians about the Virtues.” In Culture and Modernity: East-West Philosophic Perspectives, ed. Eliot Deutsch (Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1991): 104-123.
  • Masson-Oursel, Paul. Comparative Philosophy. London: Routledge, 2000.
  • Matilal, Bimal. “Pluralism, Relativism, and Interaction between Cultures.” In Culture and Modernity: East-West Philosophic Perspectives, ed. Eliot Deutsch (Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1991): 141-161.
  • Mohany, Jitendra. “Phenomenological Rationality and the Overcoming of Relativism.” In Relativism: Interpretation and Confrontation, ed. Michael Krausz (Notre Dame: Notre Dame University Press, 1989): 326-339.
  • Nussbaum, Martha. Cultivating Humanity: A Classical Defense of Reform in Liberal Education. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1997.
  • Parkes, Graham, ed. Heidegger and Asian Thought. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1987.
  • Parkes, Graham. Nietzsche and Asian Thought. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1991.
  • Putnam, Hilary. “Truth and Convention: On Davidson’s Refutation of Conceptual Relativism.” In Relativism: Interpretation and Confrontation, ed. Michael Krausz (Notre Dame: Notre Dame University Press, 1989): 173-182.
  • Raju, P. T. Introduction to Comparative Philosophy. Reprint ed. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1997.
  • Reynolds, Frank, ed. Religion and Practical Reason: New Essays in the Comparative Philosophy of Religions. Albany: State University of New York, 1994.
  • Rorty, Richard. “Solidarity or Objectivity?” In Relativism: Interpretation and Confrontation, ed. Michael Krausz (Notre Dame: Notre Dame University Press, 1989): 35-51.
  • Scharfstein, Ben-Ami. A Comparative History of World Philosophy: From the Upanishads to Kant. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1998.
  • Solomon, Robert and Kathleen Higgins. World Philosophy: A Text with Readings. New York: McGraw Hill, 1995.
  • Solomon, Robert and Kathleen Higgins, eds. From Africa to Zen: An Invitation to World Philosophy. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, 1993.
  • Van Norden, Byran. “An Open Letter to the APA.” Proceedings and Addresses of the APA. Newark, DE: American Philosophical Association, 1996.
  • Wong, David. “Three Kinds of Incommensurability.” In Relativism: Interpretation and Confrontation, ed. Michael Krausz (Notre Dame: Notre Dame University Press, 1989): 140-159.

b. Comparative Philosophy – Chinese-Western

  • Ames, Roger and Joseph Grange. John Dewey, Confucius and Global Philosophy. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1996.
  • Carr, Karen and Philip J. Ivanhoe, eds. The Sense of Antirationalism: The Religious Thought of Zhuangzi and Kierkegaard. New York: Seven Bridges Press, 2000.
  • Hall, David and Roger Ames. The Democracy of the Dead: Dewey, Confucius and the Hope for Democracy in China. Chicago: Open Court, 1999.
  • Hall, David and Roger Ames. Anticipating China: Thinking Through the Narratives of Chinese and Western Culture. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1995.
  • Kjellberg, Paul and Philip J. Ivanhoe, eds. Essays in Skepticism, Relativism and Ethics in the Zhuangzi. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1996.
  • Li Chenyang, ed. The Tao Encounters the West: Explorations in Comparative Philosophy. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1999.
  • Mou Bo, ed. Comparative Approaches to Chinese Philosophy. Aldershot, UK: Ashgate Press, 2003.
  • Neville, Robert. Boston Confucianism: Portable Tradition in the Late-Modern World. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2000.
  • Spence, Jonathan. The Chan’s Great Continent: China in Western Minds. New York: W. W. Norton, 1998.
  • Yearley, Lee. Mencius and Aquinas: Theories of Virtue and Conceptions of Courage. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990.

c. Comparative Philosophy – Indian-Western

  • Halbfass, Wilhelm. India and Europe: An Essay in Understanding. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1988.
  • Matilal, Bimal and Jaysankar Shaw, eds. Analytical Philosophy in Comparative Perspective: Exploratory Essays in Current Theories & Classical Indian Theories of Meaning. London: Kluwer Publishing, 1985.
  • McEvilley, Thomas. The Shape of Ancient Thought: Comparative Studies in Greek and Indian Philosophies. New York: Allworth Press, 2002.
  • Radahkrishan, S. The Concept of Man: A Study in Comparative Philosophy. Ed. P. T. Raju. Columbia, MO: South Asia Books, 1999.
  • Rafique, M. Indian and Muslim Philosophies. Columbia, MO: South Asia Books, 1988.
  • Tuck, Andrew. Comparative Philosophy and the Philosophy of Scholarship: On the Western Interpretation of Nagarjuna. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1990.

d. Comparative Philosophy – Japanese-Western

  • Franck, Frederick, ed. The Buddha Eye: An Anthology of the Kyoto School. New York: Crossroads, 1991.
  • Abe, Masao and William Lafleur, eds. Zen and Western Thought. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1989.
  • Loy, David. Nonduality: A Study in Comparative Philosophy. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1988.
  • Nishida, Kitaro. An Inquiry into the Good. Trans. Masao Abe and Christopher Ives. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1990.
  • Nishida, Kitaro. Last Writings: Nothingness and the Religious Worldview. Trans. David A. Dilworth. Honolulu: University of Hawai’i Press, 1987.
  • Nishitani, Keiji. Religion and Nothingness. Trans. Jan Van Bragt. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1982.

e. Comparative Philosophy – Other

  • An, Ok Sun. Compassion and Benevolence: A Comparative Study of Early Buddhist and Classical Confucian Ethics. New York: Peter Lang Publishing, 1998.
  • Taylor, Mark. Journeys to Selfhood: Hegel and Kierkegaard. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1980.

Author Information

Ronnie Littlejohn
Belmont University
U. S. A.

The Bakhtin Circle

bakhtinThe Bakhtin Circle was a 20th century school of Russian thought which centered on the work of Mikhail Mikhailovich Bakhtin (1895-1975). The circle addressed philosophically the social and cultural issues posed by the Russian Revolution and its degeneration into the Stalin dictatorship. Their work focused on the centrality of questions of significance in social life in general and artistic creation in particular, examining the way in which language registered the conflicts between social groups. The key views of the circle are that linguistic production is essentially dialogic, formed in the process of social interaction, and that this leads to the interaction of different social values being registered in terms of reaccentuation of the speech of others. While the ruling stratum tries to posit a single discourse as exemplary, the subordinate classes are inclined to subvert this monologic closure. In the sphere of literature, poetry and epics represent the centripetal forces within the cultural arena whereas the novel is the structurally elaborated expression of popular ideologiekritik, the radical criticism of society. Members of the circle included Matvei Isaevich Kagan (1889-1937); Pavel Nikolaevich Medvedev (1891-1938); Lev Vasilievich Pumpianskii (1891-1940); Ivan Ivanovich Sollertinskii (1902-1944); Valentin Nikolaevich Voloshinov (1895-1936); and others.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Early Works: 1919-1927
  3. The Concluding Works of the Bakhtin Circle: 1928-1929
  4. Bakhtin and the Theory of the Novel: 1933-1941
  5. Carnival, History And Popular Culture: Rabelais, Goethe And Dostoyevsky As Philosophers
  6. Bakhtin's Last Works
  7. Conclusion

1. Introduction

M.M. Bakhtin and his circle began meeting in the Belorussian towns of Nevel and Vitebsk in 1918 before moving to Leningrad in 1924. Their group meetings were terminated due to the arrest of many of the group in 1929. From this time until his death in 1975, Bakhtin continued to work on the topics which had occupied his group, living in internal exile first in Kustanai (Kazakhstan, 1930-36), Savelovo (about 100 km from Moscow, 1937-45), Saransk (Mordovia, 1936-7, 1945-69) and finally moving in 1969 to Moscow, where he died at the age of eighty. In Saransk Bakhtin worked at the Mordov Pedagogical Institute (now University) until retirement in 1961.

The Bakhtin circle is reputed to have been initiated by Kagan on his return from Germany, where he had studied philosophy in Leipzig, Berlin and Marburg. He had been a pupil of the founder of Marburg Neo-Kantianism Herman Cohen and had attended lectures by Ernst Cassirer. Kagan established a "Kantian Seminar" at which various philosophical, religious and cultural issues were discussed. Kagan was a Jewish intellectual who had been a member of the Social Democratic Party (the precursor of the Bolsheviks and Mensheviks) and he may have been attracted to Cohen's philosophy for its supposed affinity with Marxism (Cohen regarded his ethical philosophy as completely compatible with that of Marx), while rejecting the atheism of Russian Communism. Whatever the truth of the matter, the members of the circle did not restrict themselves to academic philosophy but became closely involved in the radical cultural activities of the time, activities which became more intense with the movement of the group to Vitebsk, where many important avant-garde artists such as Malevich and Chagall had settled to avoid the privations of the Civil War. One of the group, Pavel Medvedev, a graduate in law from Petrograd University, became rector of the Vitebsk Proletarian University, editing the town's cultural journalIskusstvo (Art) to which he and Voloshinov contributed articles, while Bakhtin and Pumpianskii both gave public lectures on a variety of philosophical and cultural topics, as seen in recently published student notes. Pumpianskii, it is known, never finished his studies at Petrograd university, while it is doubtful whether Bakhtin had any formal higher education at all despite his claims, now disproven, to have graduated from the same University in 1918. It seems that Bakhtin attempted to gain acceptance in academic circles by adopting aspects of his older brother's biography. Nikolai Bakhtin had a solid classical education from his German governess and graduated from Petrograd University, where he had been a pupil of the renowned classicist F.F. Zelinskii. Bakhtin had therefore been exposed to philosophical ideas since his youth. After Nikolai's departure for the Crimea, and Mikhail's move to Nevel, it seems that Kagan took the place of his brother as unofficial mentor, having an important influence on Bakhtin's philosophy in a new and exciting cultural environment, although the two friends went their separate ways in 1921, the year Bakhtin married.

Kagan, however, moved to take up a teaching position at the newly established provincial university in Orel in 1921. While there he published the only sustained piece of philosophy to be published by a member of the group before the late 1920s entitled "Kak vozmozhna istoria" (How Is History Possible) in 1922. The same year he produced an obituary of Hermann Cohen in which he stressed the historical and sociological aspects of Cohen's philosophy and wrote other unpublished works. 1922 also saw the publication of Pumpianskii's paper "Dostoevskii i antichnost´" (Dostoyevsky and Antiquity), a theme that was to recur in Bakhtin's work for many years. While Bakhtin himself did not publish any substantial work until 1929, he was clearly working on matters related to Neo-Kantian philosophy and the problem of authorship at this time. Bakhtin's earliest published work is the two page "Iskusstvo i otvetstvennost´" (Art and Answerability) from 1919 and fragments of a larger project on moral philosophy written between 1920 and 1924, now usually referred to as K filosofii postupka (Towards a Philosophy of the Act).

Most of the group's significant work was produced after their move to Leningrad in 1924. It seems that there the group became acutely aware of the challenge posed by Saussurean linguistics and its development in the work of the Formalists. Thus there emerges a new awareness of the importance of the philosophy of language in philosophy and poetics. The most significant work on the philosophy of language was published in the period 1926-1930 by Voloshinov: a series of articles and a book entitledMarksizm i filosofia iazyka (Marxism and the Philosophy of Language) (1929). Medvedev, who had been put in charge of the archive of the symbolist poet Aleksandr Blok, participated in the vigorous discussions between Marxist and formalist literary theorists with a series of articles and a book, Formal´lnyi metod v literaturovedenii (The Formal Method in Literary Scholarship) (1928) and the first book-length study of Blok's work. Voloshinov also published an article and a book (1925, 1926) on the debate which raged around Freudianism at the time. In 1929 Bakhtin produced the first edition of his famous monograph Problemy tvorchestva Dostoevskogo (Problems of Dostoyevsky's Work), but many other works dating from 1924-9 remained unpublished and usually unfinished. Among these was a critical essay on formalism called "Problema soderzheniia i formy v slovesnom khudozhestvennom tvorchestve" (The Problem of Content, Material and Form in Verbal Artistic Creation) (1924) and a book length study called "Avtor i geroi v esteticheskoi deiatel´nosti" (Author and Hero in Aesthetic Activity) (1924-7).

Since the 1970s the works published under the names of Voloshinov and Medvedev have often been ascribed to Bakhtin, who neither consented nor objected. A voluminous, ideologically motivated, often bad-tempered and largely futile body of literature has grown up to contest the issue one way or another, but since there is no concrete evidence to suggest that the published authors were not responsible for the texts which bear their names, there seems no real case to answer. It seems much more likely that the materials were written as a result of lively group discussions around these issues, which group members wrote up according to their own perspectives afterwards. There are clearly many philosophical, ideological and stylistic discrepancies which, despite the presence of certain parallels and points of agreement, suggest these very different works were largely the work of different authors. In accordance with Bakhtin's own philosophy, it seems logical to treat them as rejoinders in ongoing dialogues between group members on the one hand and between the group and other contemporary thinkers on the other.

The sharp deterioration in the situation of unorthodox intellectuals in the Soviet Union at the end of 1928 effectively broke the Bakhtin circle up. Bakhtin, whose health had already begun to deteriorate, was arrested, presumably because of his connection with the St. Petersburg Religious-Philosophical society, and was sentenced to ten years on the Solovetskii Islands. After vigorous intercession by Bakhtin's friends, a favourable review of his Dostoyevsky book by Commissar of Enlightenment Lunacharskii and a personal appeal by Maksim Gor´kii, this was commuted to six years exile in Kazakhstan. With the tightening of censorship at the time, very little was published by Voloshinov, while Medvedev published a book on theories of authorship V laboratorii pisatelia (In the Laboratory of the Writer) in 1933 and a new version of the Formalism study, revised to fit in more closely with the ideological requirements of the time, in 1934. Medvedev was appointed full professor at the Leningrad Historico-Philological Institute but was arrested and disappeared during the terror of 1938. Voloshinov worked at the Herzen Pedagogical Institute in Leningrad until 1934 when he contracted tuberculosis. He died in a sanitorium two year later leaving unfinished a translation of the first volume of Ernst Cassirer's The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms, a book which is of considerable importance in the work of the circle. Kagan died of angina in 1937 after working as editor of an encyclopedic atlas of energy resources in the Soviet Union for many years. Pumpianskii pursued a successful career as Professor of Literature at Leningrad University, but published only short articles and introductions to works of Russian authors, most notably Turgenev. Sollertinskii joined the Leningrad Philharmonic in 1927 as a lecturer, but soon established himself as one of the leading Soviet musicologists, producing over two hundred articles, books and reviews. He died of a heart attack, probably resulting from the privations of the Leningrad blockade, in 1944.

While in Kazakhstan Bakhtin began work on his now famous theory of the novel which resulted in the now famous articles Slovo v romane (Discourse in the Novel) (1934-5), Iz predystorii romannogo slovo (From the Prehistory of Novelistic Discourse) (1940), Epos i roman (Epic and Novel) (1941),Formy vremeni i khronotopa v romane (Forms of Time and Chronotope in the Novel) (1937-8). Between 1936 and 1938 he completed a book on the Bildungsroman and its significance in the history of realism which was lost when the publishing house at which the manuscript was lying awaiting publication was destroyed in the early days of the German invasion of the Soviet Union in 1941. Voluminous, most still unpublished, preparatory material still exists, although part is lost, allegedly because Bakhtin used it for cigarette papers during the wartime paper shortage. Bakhtin's exceptional productiveness at this time is further accentuated when one considers that one of his legs was amputated in February 1938. He had suffered from inflammation of the bone marrow, osteomyelitis, for many years, which gave him a lot of pain, high temperatures, and often confined him to bed for weeks on end. This had been a factor in the appeals of his friends and acquaintances for clemency when he was internally exiled, a factor that may well have saved his life. This did not, however, prevent him from presenting a now famous doctoral thesis on Rabelais to the Gor´kii Institute of World Literature in 1940. The work proved extremely controversial in the hostile ideological climate of the time and it was not until 1951 that Bakhtin was eventually granted the qualification of kandidat. It was not published in book form until 1965.

The period between the completion of the Rabelais study and the second edition of the Dostoyevsky study in 1963 is perhaps the least well known of Bakhtin's life in terms of work produced. This has been recently (1996) rectified with the publication of archival materials from this period, when Bakhtin was working as a lecturer at the Mordov Pedagogical Institute. The most substantial work dating from this period is Problema rechevykh zhanrov (The Problem of Speech Genres) which was most likely produced in response to the reorganisation of Soviet linguistics in the wake of Stalin's article Marksizm i voprosy iazykoznaniia (Marxism and Questions of Linguistics) of 1953. Many other fragments exist from this time, including notes for a planned article about Maiakovskii and more methodological comments on the study of the novel.

In the more liberal atmosphere of the so-called "thaw" following Khruschev's accession, Bakhtin's work on Dostoyevsky came to the attention of a group of younger scholars led by Vadim Kozhinov who, upon finding out that he was still alive, contacted Bakhtin and tried to convince him to republish the 1929 Dostoyevsky book. After some initial hesitation, Bakhtin responded by significantly expanding and fundamentally altering the overall project. It was accepted for publication in September 1963 and received a generally favourable reception. Publication of the Rabelais study, newly edited for purposes of acceptability (mainly the toning down of scatology and an analysis of a speech by Lenin) followed soon after. As Bakhtin's health continued to decline, he was taken to hospital in Moscow in 1969 and in May 1970 he and his wife, who died a year later, were moved into a retirement home just outside Moscow. Bakhtin continued to work until just before his death in 1975, producing work of a mainly methodological character.

Since Bakhtin's death, several collections of his work have appeared in Russian and many translations have followed. English language translations have been appearing since 1968, although the quality of translation and systematicity of publication has been uneven. Up to ten different translators have published work by a writer whose terminology is very specific, often rendering key concepts in a variety of different ways. This has exacerbated problems of interpretation and questions of theoretical heritage, especially since there is a quite sharp distinction between works written before and after the 1929 Dostoyevsky study. Another problem has been the questions of authorship of the Bakhtin circle and the extent to which a Marxist vocabulary in the works of Voloshinov and Medvedev should be taken at face value. Those, for example, who argue Bakhtin was the author of these works also tend to argue that the vocabulary is mere "window dressing" to facilitate publication, while those who support the authenticity of the original publications also tend to take the Marxist arguments seriously. As a result writers about Bakhtin have tended to choose one period of Bakhtin's career and treat it as definitive, a practice which has produced a variety of divergent versions of "Bakhtinian" thought. The recent appearance of the first volume of a collected works in Russian might help to overcome the problems which have dogged Bakhtin studies.

2. The Early Works: 1919-1927

The work of the Bakhtin Circle should be regarded as a philosophy of culture. Questions which seem to be of very specific relevance, such as the modality of author-hero relations, actually involve questions of a much more general nature encompassing the value-laden relations between subject and object, subjects and other subjects. The phenomenological arguments presented by the young Bakhtin are directed against the abstractions of rationalist philosophy and contemporary positivism. He draws much of his conceptual structure from the work of the Marburg School (most notably Hermann Cohen (1842-1918), Paul Natorp (1854-1924) and Nicolai Hartmann (1882-1950)) and German phenomenologists such as Max Scheler (1874-1928) and Heinrich Rickert (1863-1936). However, it is particularly difficult to trace the precise influence of these writers because Bakhtin was notoriously inconsistent in crediting his sources and was not averse to copying whole passages which he had translated from German into Russian in his works without reference to the original. This has led many commentators either to guess at influences on the young Bakhtin or to credit him with the invention of a philosophical vocabulary almost from nothing. However, recent archival work by Brian Poole has uncovered notebooks in which Bakhtin made copious notes from various German idealist philosophers which give us a better idea both of the sources of his ideas and the originality of the philosophical work which resulted from his fusion of disparate ideas.

The ideas of the Marburg School were undoubtedly filtered to Bakhtin through the works of Matvei Kagan on his return from Germany at the end of the First World War. In his obituary of Cohen Kagan stressed the religious, messianic aspects of the former's philosophy, which emerges in his later work. For the late Cohen, "the unity of objective being, as an unending large process of the unity of being and concept demands the unending small unity of the singular individuum.... The whole problem of religion is contained in the problem of the individuum as in the question of God." The continual relationship between the individuum and God is the absolute element of subjectivity and is the unity of monotheism. The individual does not combine with God but continually relates to God. This has social significance, for religion grows out of ethics: "the religion of the unity of humanity is monotheism.... Religion is everywhere, in all regions of culture.... Religion itself is philosophy." Problems of intersubjectivity must be related to questions of historical development: "in our opinion, the problem of individual relationships, the problem of subjective consciousness, ontological subjectivity can be based on the pathos of the individual condition of the struggle of the historical life of culture, the person and humanity." Kagan stresses the parallels between Cohen's ethics and the traditions of Russian populism, a factor which recurs later in Bakhtin's career when the novel becomes linked with a populist political process. (M. Kagan, German Kogen, 1922) The unity of the individual is dependent on the unity of the people and this is in turn dependent on the unity of God.

Whatever the difficulties of tracing his more immediate precursors, there is no doubt that Bakhtin's philosophical project maintained a fundamental connection with the traditions of Enlightenment aesthetics and with Kantianism in particular. As for Kant, the aesthetic is distinguished by its "disinterestedness," the uncoupling of purposiveness from representation of the end. Where Kant concentrated on aesthetic judgement, however, Bakhtin was interested in aesthetic activity which can help to establish a mode of reciprocal intersubjective relationships necessary to produce an intimate unity of individuals whose specificity is in no way endangered. This project, which remains constant throughout his work, adopts various forms. The aesthetic is the realm where now detached from the "open event of being" and "finalized" by virtue of the author's "exteriority" (vnenakhodimost´), the value-laden essence of the hero's deed is manifested. If the hero's activity were not objectified by the author then he or she would remain in some perpetual stream of consciousness, completely oblivious to the wider significance of those deeds. However, in order to visualise the meaningful nature of those deeds, the author must also have an insight into the subjective world of the hero, his or her horizon, sphere of views and interests (krugozor). Only the appropriate mode of empathy and objectification can produce the sort of productive whole Bakhtin envisages.

Several problems arise from this model. The first is that Bakhtin seems to want to use the author-hero model as a reciprocal principle within society and as a model of relations in literary composition. In the first model authors and heroes change their roles constantly, the unique perspective of each subject allows the objectification of others except oneself, who is objectified by others. Although the concept hardly appears in the early works, from 1928 onwards dialogue becomes the model of such interactions: one gains an awareness of one's own place within the whole through dialogue, which helps to bestow an awareness on others at the same time. This is a very pleasant model as long as relationships remain equal. Yet the author-hero model also assumes a fundamental inequality in that the hero of a work can never have a reciprocal vantage point from which to objectify the author and thus the creator. There is a crucial difference between a person-to-person and a person-to-God relationship which Bakhtin's model seems to obscure.

Furthermore, Bakhtin's model of the unique perspective of each author/hero, which is drawn from the Kantian model of an individual consciousness bearing a-priori categories encountering and giving form to the manifold of sense impressions, is seriously compromised when one admits a socio-linguistic dimension into the equation. This happens in Voloshinov's 1926 article on discourse in life and poetry. The alternative adopted by Voloshinov foregrounds the intonational dimension of language which manifests the unique evaluative connections between subject and object. Language enmeshed within everyday practical activity is extracted, or liberated, from its connection with the "open event of being" by the author who then reflects upon it, from his or her own unique vantage point, manifesting its total intonational meaning. The hero's language is alien to the author and therefore ripe for objectification; the crucial category is the latter's exteriority. Stress on this intonational dimension allows the encounter of the two consciousnesses to be spoken about in phenomenological rather than linguistic terms and therefore allows Bakhtin to counter what he calls "theoreticism", the tendency to consider the inner meaning of an action and its historical specificity in isolation from each other. This might include Hegel's tendency to view the particular incident as meaningful only as an instance of the unfolding of reason, Husserl's sublation of inter-subjective relations in transcendental subjectivity or the positivistic assumption that categorisation of a phenomenon is sufficient to explain that phenomenon.

The distinctively Bakhtinian approach to language only really begins to emerge in Voloshinov's 1926 essay Slovo v zhizni i slovo v poezii: k voprosam sotsiologicheskoi poetiki (Discourse in Life and Discourse in Poetry: Questions of Sociological Poetics), written during his postgraduate studies at the Institute of Material, Artistic and Verbal Culture in Leningrad where L.P. Iakubinskii, the pioneer of the study of dialogic speech, was among his advisers. This work, which has been seen as the earliest example of pragmatics by more than one commentator, is the first work of the circle to be presented as an explicitly Marxist text. The author attempts to define the aesthetic as a specific form of social interaction characterised by its "completion by the creation of the artistic work and by its continual recreations in cocreative perception and it does not require any other objectifications". In the artistic work unspoken social evaluations are "condensed" and determine artistic form. The deeper structural features of a particular social interaction are made manifest in a successful artistic work; as Voloshinov puts it, "form should be a convincing evaluation of the content" (Bakhtin School Papers ed. Shukman, Colchester 1983 p.9, 19, 20). The early Bakhtinian phenomenology is now recast in terms of discursive interaction, with a specifically sociological frame of reference.

Another of Voloshinov's projects was a critical response to incipient psychoanalysis and contemporary attempts to attempt a fusion of Marxism and Freudianism. In 1927 he published his first book calledFreidizm: Kriticheskii ocherk (Freudianism a Critical Sketch), which continued the theme of an earlier article from 1925 Po tu storonu sotsial´nogo (Just Beyond the Social) in which Freud was accused of a biological reductionism and subjectivism quite alien to the spirit of Marxism. Leaning upon a sociological analysis of language and culture, Voloshinov stresses that intersubjectivity precedes subjectivity as such and that all meaning production and thus repression of meanings are socio-ideological rather than individual and biological as Freud supposed. It must be noted, however, that Voloshinov does not pay any attention to Freud's later work on cultural phenomena and thus presents a rather one-sided view of contemporary psychology. Furthermore, Freudianism is treated as a manifestation of "bourgeois decay" very much in the spirit of the later Lukács. This indicates a turning towards a more Hegelian approach to questions of cultural and philosophical development, while the recasting of the Freudian superego in terms of the repression of unofficial ideologies by an official ideology anticipates one of the central themes that would occupy Bakhtin in the 1930s and 1940s.

3. The Concluding Works of the Bakhtin Circle: 1928-1929

In the late 1920s the sociological and linguistic turn signalled by Voloshinov's article on discourse had begun to form into a distinct school of thought in which language was the index of social relations and embodiment of ideological worldview. While Voloshinov's linguistic studies were undoubtedly crucial to this reorientation, one of the central influences on the group at the time was the work of Ernst Cassirer, whose ground-breaking Philosophy of Symbolic Forms (3 Vols) was published between 1923 and 1929. One of Voloshinov's unfinished projects, which he began while at University, was a translation of the first volume of Cassirer's work on language. This volume marked the culmination of Cassirer's move away from Marburg Neo-Kantianism to a Hegelian rectification of Kant. Adopting Hegel's dialectical orientation, evolutionary approach to human knowledge and existence and concentration of the totality of human activities, Cassirer sought to overcome the exclusivity of the Kantian focus on mankind's rational thought processes. At the same time, however, Cassirer strove to resist the Hegelian subsumption of all realms of the human spirit into the Absolute by retaining the Kantian distinction between the "languages" of the human spirit. To this end Cassirer drew upon Herder and von Humboldt's identification of thought and signification, viewing the "symbolic function" as the common element to all areas of knowledge, but which took a specific form in each of them. The truth, agreed Cassirer and Hegel, is whole, but the former understood this to mean that each of the perspectives offered by various symbolic forms is equally valid and must be progressively "unfolded" so as to fully articulate itself. This formulation, as we shall see, had a far reaching effect on the later work of Bakhtin, but there are signs of its influence almost immediately in the work of the group.

In 1928 P.N. Medvedev published a book-length critique of Russian Formalism. This work begins with a definition of literary scholarship as "one branch of the study of ideologies", a study which "embraces all areas of man's ideological creativity". Medvedev goes on to argue that while Marxism has established the basis of such a study, including its relationship to economic factors, the study of "the distinctive features and qualitative individuality of each of the branches of ideological creation -- science, art, ethics, religion, and so forth. -- is still in the embryonic stage" (p.3). Despite the replacement of "symbolic forms" with "branches of ideological creation" the continuity of approach is clear. Where Cassirer sought to examine the symbolic function as "a factor which recurs in each basic cultural form but in no two takes exactly the same shape" (vol. 1, p.84), Medvedev sought to investigate the "sociological laws of development" which can be found in each "branch" of "ideological creation" but which manifests itself in specific ways. This sociological adaption of Cassirer's work was to feature largely in Bakhtin's work from the 1930s and 1940s, where, as Poole has demonstrated, many unattributed passages from the former's work appear in Russian translation within the body of the latter's work. Medvedev felt that the Formalists were correct in attempting to define the specific features of literary creation but fundamentally mistaken in the positivistic approach they took towards literary devices which tended to efface the ideological, meaning-bearing and thus sociological aspect of literary form. In conclusion Medvedev recommended that the formalists be treated respectfully and seriously, even if their fundamental premises were erroneous. Marxist criticism, he argued, should value Formalism as an object of serious criticism through which the bases of the former can be clarified.

While subjecting the Russian Formalists to intense criticism on the basis of their partisan alliance with the Futurist movement and their sharing its tendency towards a nihilistic destruction of meaning, Medvedev particularly praised Western "formalist art scholarship" such as the work of Hildebrand, Wölfflin and Worringer. These theorists were important for the development of the Bakhtin circle because they treated changes of artistic forms and styles as changes of "artistic volition", that is, having ideological significance. Worringer saw art history to be marked by an alternation of naturalism (empathy) and abstraction (estrangement) which correlated to the harmony or otherwise in the relationship of man and his environment. While formal and evaluative aspects are not identical, they do tend to maintain a close affiliation and this, Medvedev concluded, can be applied to literary form as well as visual art. This particular chapter, along with some shorter extracts of the book were omitted from the second edition of the book published with the title Formalizm I formalisty (Formalism and the Formalists) in 1934. By this time a tolerant attitude towards the Formalists or Western scholarship was not permitted, and thus an additional and extremely hostile chapter called "The Collapse of Formalism" was included. Earlier writers on the Bakhtin Circle tended to ascribe the first edition to Bakhtin and the second to Medvedev, but it is clear that the body of the second edition is an expurgated version of the first.

Medvedev's formulation was carried over into Bakhtin's now famous study Problemy tvorchestva Dostoevskogo (Problems of Dostoyevsky's Work) published in 1929. Here the great nineteenth-century novelist's own verbally affirmed and often reactionary ideology is downplayed in favour of his "form-shaping ideology" which is seen to be imbued with a profoundly democratic spirit. Bakhtin attacks those critics, such as Engelgardt, who characterised Dostoyevsky's creative method as Hegelian. In such a scheme two positions struggle for ascendancy but are transformed into a synthesis at the end; however, according to Bakhtin, there is no merging of voices into a final, authoritative voice as in the Hegelian absolute. Dostoyevsky does not present an abstract dialectic but an unmerged dialogue of voices, each given equal rights. Bakhtin follows the nineteenth-century German novelist and critic Otto Ludwig in terming this type of dialogue "polyphonic dialogue", which allows Cassirer's insistence on a plurality of cultural forms to be extended to a plurality of discourses in society and the novel. In the course of Dostoyevsky's novels, argues Bakhtin, very much in the spirit of Cassirer, the worldviews of Dostoyevsky's heroes "unfold", presenting their own unique perspective upon the world. The novelist does not, as is the case with Tolstoi, submerge all positions beneath a single authoritative perspective, but allows the voice of the narrator to reside beside the voices of the characters, bestowing no greater authority on that voice than on any of the others. Voices intersect and interact, mutually illuminating their ideological structures, potentialities, biases and limitations.

Bakhtin's early phenomenology is now translated into discursive terms. Where Bakhtin was initially concerned with intersubjective relations and the modality of authorial and heroic interaction, this is now examined in terms of the way in which one language encounters another, reporting and modifying the utterance by reaccentuating it. Modes of interaction range from stylisation to explicit parody, which Bakhtin spends a considerable proportion of the book cataloguing. As only the later edition of the book (1963) has been published in English, there is a tendency to confuse the chronology of the emergence of Bakhtin's key concepts. It should be noted that there is no reflection on carnival or on the Menippean Satire in the first edition of the Dostoyevsky study. These features only emerged in the next decade in relation to the history of the novel as a genre. The first edition of the Dostoyevsky study is a monograph on the work of the famous novelist in terms which in many respects embody the poetics of a significant portion of contemporary "fellow-traveller" writing. When considered in its historical context, the Dostoyevsky study can be seen as a sort of rearguard defence of liberality in the cultural arena against the encroachment of political control. The book was published on the eve of the destructive RAPP dictatorship, when bellicose advocates of "proletarian culture" were granted free reign by the newly victorious Stalinist leadership of the Soviet Communist Party. Formal experimentation and an inadequately tendentious narrative position was branded as reactionary, while Bakhtin's work defended the presentation of a plurality of perspectives free from "monologic" closure. The formal characteristics of a work were themselves of ideological significance, but the reactionary tendency was in the imposition of a unitary perspective on a varied community of opinion.

The semiotic dimension of the new orientation of the Bakhtin Circle was developed at the same time by Voloshinov. In a series of articles between 1928 and 1930 punctuated by the appearance of the book-length Marksizm i filosofiia iazyka (Marxism and the Philosophy of Language) in 1929 (2nd edition 1930) Voloshinov published an analysis of the relationship between language and ideology unsurpassed for several decades. Voloshinov examines two contemporary accounts of language, what he calls "abstract objectivism", whose leading exponent is Saussure, and "individualistic subjectivism", developed from the work of Wilhelm von Humboldt by the romantic idealists Benedetto Croce (1866-1952) and Karl Vossler (1872-1942). Voloshinov argues that the two trends derive from rationalism and romanticism respectively and share both the strengths and weaknesses of those movements. While the former identifies the systematic and social character of language it mistakes the "system of self-identical forms" for the source of language usage in society; it abstracts language from the concrete historical context of its utilisation (Bakhtin's "theoreticism"); the part is examined at the expense of the whole; the individual linguistic element is treated as a "thing" at the expense of the dynamics of speech; a unity of word meaning is assumed to the neglect of the multiplicity of meaning and accent and language is treated as a ready-made system whose developments are aberrations. The latter trend is correct in viewing language as a continuous generative process and asserting that this process is meaningful, but fundamentally wrong in identifying the laws of that creation with those of individual psychology, viewing the generative process as analogous with art and treating the system of signs as an inert crust of the creative process. These partial insights, Voloshinov argues that a stable system of linguistic signs is merely a scientific abstraction; the generative process of language is implemented in the social-verbal interaction of speakers; the laws of language generation are sociological laws; although linguistic and artistic creativity do not coincide, this creativity must be understood in relation to the ideological meanings and values that fill language and that the structure of each concrete utterance is a sociological structure.

Several commentators have noted how Voloshinov's approach to language anticipates many of the criticisms of linguistic philosophy levelled by present day Poststructuralists, but does so without invoking the relativism of much of the latter or the nullity of Derrida's "hors texte." Voloshinov firmly establishes the sign-bound nature of consciousness and the shifting nature of the language system, but instead of viewing the subject as fragmented by the reality of difference, he poses each utterance to be a microcosm of social conflict. This allows sociological structure and the plurality of discourse to be correlated according to a unitary historical development. In this sense Voloshinov's critique bears a strong resemblance to the Italian Communist leader Antonio Gramsci's account of hegemony in his Prison Notebooks. Like Voloshinov and Bakhtin, Gramsci drew upon the work of Croce and Vossler and Matteo Bartoli's Saussurean "spatial linguistics", and combined it with a Hegelian reading of Marxism. As we have seen, however, Voloshinov was heavily influenced by the work of Cassirer, whose admiration for the work of von Humboldt, the founder of generative linguistics, was substantial. Voloshinov's critique thus tended towards the romantic pole of language study rather than taking up the equidistant position he claimed in his study. This can be seen in the tendency to see social groups as collective subjects rather than institutionally defined collectives and such assertions as those which suggest the meaning of a word is "totally determined" by its context. What Voloshinov effectively does is to supplement Humboldt's recognition of individual and national linguistic variability with a sociological dimension. Humboldt's "inner-form" of language is recast as the relationality of discourse, dialogism. Abandoning the Marxist distinction between base and superstructure, Voloshinov follows Cassirer and Hegel in seeing the variety of linguistic forms as expressions of a single essence. It is significant that Gramsci, who adopted a consistently pragmatist epistemology followed the same course and emerged with startlingly similar formulations.

This suggests that the relations between the work of the Bakhtin school and Marxism are ones which are complex and worthy of close scrutiny. Those who have tried to set up a Chinese wall between the two tendencies or who have tried to identify them, have consistently failed to do justice to this philosophical dialogue. Some have even gone so far as to see the work of the group as fundamentally anti-Hegelian, a charge which collapses as soon as one traces the use of terminology in the works from the late 1920s.

4. Bakhtin and the Theory of the Novel: 1933-1941

The shift in Bakhtin's thought from Kant towards Hegel is nowhere clearer than in his central works on the novel. This can be seen in the new centrality Bakhtin grants to the history of literature to which Kant had been largely indifferent. As if to stress his indebtedness to German idealism, Bakhtin adopts all of the characteristics of the novel as a genre catalogued by Goethe, Schlegel and Hegel with little modification and traces how the "essence" of the genre "appears" over a course of time. The development of the novel is described in a way distinctly reminiscent of Cassirer's "symbolic forms" which unfold to present their unique view of the world which is itself a modified version of Hegel's characterisation of thePhenomenology of Spirit as the representation of "appearing knowledge". At the same time, however, the novel adopts many of the features of the role of Hegel's philosophy in its Cassireran guise as the philosophy of culture. Such a philosophy, argued Cassirer, does not attempt to go behind the various image worlds created by the human spirit but "to understand and elucidate their basic formative principle" (The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms vol. 1, Language p.113). The novel, according to the scheme developed by Bakhtin, elucidates this principle with regard both to other literary genres and socio-ideological discourses. The old idealist formulation of the novel's imperative that it be a "full and comprehensive reflection of its era" is reformulated as "the novel must represent all the ideological voices of its era... all the era's languages that have any claim to being significant" (411). The novel is a symbolic form, but a specific one in which the "basic formative principle" of symbolic forms becomes visible. The socially stratified national language, heteroglossia in itself, becomes heteroglossia for-itself rather as thought perceives itself as its own object at the climax of Hegel's Phenomenology.

The novel, for Bakhtin, uncovers the formative principle of discourse, its relationality, dialogism, without presenting some final absolute language of truth such as that which constitutes Hegelian conceptualism. The novel develops into something akin to a visio intellectualis of the sort Cassirer found in the work of Nicholas Cusanus. This is a whole which includes all various viewpoints in its accidentiality and necessity, "the thing seen and the manner and direction of the seeing" (Cassirer The Individual and the Cosmos in Renaissance Philosophy 1963, p.32). No individual perspective is adequate to the whole in itself, for only the concrete totality of perspectives can present the whole:

Languages of heteroglossia, like mirrors that face each other, each of which in its own way reflects a little piece, a tiny corner of the world, force us to guess at and grasp behind their inter-reflecting aspects for a world that is broader, more multi-levelled and multi-horizoned than would be available to one language, one mirror. (Bakhtin Voprosy literatury i estetikipp.225-26)

While this aspect of Bakhtin's theory of the novel is most likely based on the philosophy of Cassirer, who developed his work as a defence of liberal values in the context of an increasingly chauvinistic atmosphere in Weimar Germany, a different political slant becomes markedly more apparent in Bakhtin's work of the 1930s. The novelist now becomes the heir of an anti-authoritarian popular cultural strategy to deflate the pretensions of the official language and ideology and institute a popular-collective learning process. The antecedent of this strategy is not German bourgeois liberalism but Russian populism (narodnichestvo). Thus the dialectic of mythical and critical symbolic forms which Cassirer outlined in his philosophy now becomes fused with a dialectic of official and popular socio-cultural forces. On one side stand the forces of cultural centralisation and stabilisation: the "official strata", unitary language, the literary canon and so on. On the other side stands the decentralising influence of popular culture: popular festivity and collective ridicule, literary parody, and the anti-canonic novel. The rise of the novel is correlated with the collapse of antique unity and the breaking down of cultural boundaries. Where the official culture developed a canon of poetic genres which posited a rarified language in opposition to the common spoken language, presented a monolithically serious worldview and epic accounts of a golden age and heroic beginnings, the novel parodies these features, ridiculing the official culture's claims to universal validity and the ossified conventionality of canonic forms and language.

The novel is thus a literary expression of a whole socio-cultural process, but this process is rather too broad to be incorporated under the label Bakhtin gives to it without considerable problems with regard to conceptual accuracy. The adjective poetic becomes shorthand for the whole complex of institutional and cultural forms which can be included on the side of officialdom. Thus poetic denotes both a type of discourse used in artistic texts and a hierarchical relation between discourses which constitutes the hegemonic relationships of an unequal society. Correspondingly, novelistic describes both the character of a genre, multi-accented artistic discourse, and an anti-authoritarian relationship between discourses. Another pair of terms which is often used interchangeably with these two is monologic and dialogic. The former denotes a mono-accentual type of discourse and an authoritarian stance towards another discourse. The latter describes a multi-accentual discourse, the relationality of discourse, and an orientation on a monologic discourse which seeks to reveal the ideological structure lurking behind surface appearances. The ground between formal and political terms shifts before the reader, who is constantly reminded of the institutional co-ordinates for all discursive phenomena but is never presented with a sociological account of those co-ordinates. This might be explained both by the ideological restrictions placed on any writer in Stalin's Russia and by the idealist frame of Bakhtin's own theory. This ambiguity has allowed very different interpretations of Bakhtin's work to be drawn, ranging from a tendency to reduce the whole argument to one of artistic forms, leading to a liberalistic formal criticism and attempts to correlate Bakhtin's argument with the institutional forms of modern capitalist society. Bakhtin's work has thus become a battleground between (mainly American) liberal academics and (mainly British) anti-Stalinist Marxists.

In its classical phase, Russian populism was, according to Walicki, "opposed to the "abstract intellectualism" of those revolutionaries who tried to teach the peasants, to impose on them the ideals of Western socialism, instead of learning what were their real needs and acting in the name of such interests and ideals of which the peasants had already become aware". Yet it also suggested an opposition to those Second International Marxists who argued that capitalism was an unavoidable stage in the development of Russia (The Controversy Over Capitalism 1989 p.3). In one sense, then, it was a political ideology compatible with Third International Marxism, but in another it sought to reverse the hegemony of intellectuals over "the people". Bakhtin's poet is a hegemonic intellectual whose language relates in an authoritative fashion to the discourse of the masses, while the novelist aims to break and indeed reverse that hegemonic relationship. In Bakhtin's formulation, the locus of critical forces of culture is the people, while the mythological forces of culture emerge from the official stratum.

Many of the central works on the novel were at least partially written in response to the theory of the novel developed by Georg Lukács. Bakhtin had begun to translate Lukács' Theory of the Novel in the 1920s but abandoned the project upon learning that Lukács no longer liked the book but in the 1930s, when Lukács accommodated to the Stalin regime and essentially became a right Hegelian, his theory of the novel became canonical. Bakhtin agreed with Lukács that the novel represented the "essence of the age" and that irony constituted a central factor of the novelistic method, but rejected the latter's assertion that unless the novel revealed the thread of rationality running through a seemingly anarchic world, that is, presented an authoritative perspective, the author had succumbed to bourgeois decadence. Modernist formal experimentation and the dominance of parody in modernist literature Lukács found to be a reflection of "bourgeois decay", while Bakhtin strove to reveal its popular-democratic roots. The novel should not be seen as a compensation for the restlessness of contemporary society, uncovering the assured road to progress, but the embodiment of the dynamic forces that could shape society in a popular-democratic fashion. Thus where Lukács championed epic closure, Bakhtin highlighted novelistic openendedness; where Lukács advocated a strong narrative presence, Bakhtin advocated the maximalisation of multilingual intersection and the testing of discourse. Bakhtin takes a left Hegelian stance against Lukács; dialogism becomes analogous to Hegel's Geist, both describing the social whole and standing in judgement over those eras in which the dialogic imperative is not realised.

5. Carnival, History And Popular Culture: Rabelais, Goethe And Dostoyevsky As Philosophers

The high point of Bakhtin's populism can be seen in his now famous 1965 study of Rabelais and the heavily revised second edition of the 1929 Dostoyevsky book (1963). The former had been composed as Bakhtin's doctoral dissertation which had been written in the late 1930s but was only prepared for publication when he emerged from obscurity in the 1960s. Tvorchestvo Fransua Rable i narodnaia kul´tura srednevekov´ia i renessansa (The work of François Rabelais and the Popular Culture of the Middle Ages and the Renaissance) is a remarkable work. Bakhtin concentrates on the collapse of the strict hierarchies of the Middle Ages and the beginning of the Renaissance by looking at the way in which ancient modes of living and working collectively, in accordance with the rhythms of nature, re-emerge in the forms of popular culture opposed to official culture. In Problemy poetiki Dostoevskogo (Problems of Dostoyevsky's Poetics) Bakhtin summarises the essence of the question thus:

It could be said (with certain reservations, of course) that a person of the Middle Ages lived, as it were, two lives: one that was the official life, monolithically serious and gloomy, subjugated to a strict hierarchical order, full of terror, dogmatism, reverence and piety; the other was the life of the carnival square, free and unrestricted, full of ambivalent laughter, blasphemy, the profanation of everything sacred, full of debasing and obscenities, familiar contact with everyone and everything. Both these lives were legitimate, but separated by strict temporal boundaries. (p.129-30)

The activities of the carnival square: collective ridicule of officialdom, inversion of hierarchy, violations of decorum and proportion, celebration of bodily excess and so on embody, for Bakhtin, an implicit popular conception of the world. This conception is not, however, able to become ideologically elaborated until the radical laughter of the square entered into the "world of great literature" (Rabelais p.96). The novel of Rabelais is seen as the epitome of this process of breaking down the rigid, hierarchical world of the Middle Ages and the birth of the modern era. Rabelais is much more than a novelist for Bakhtin: his work embodies a whole new philosophy of history, in which the world is viewed in the process of becoming. The grotesque is the image of this becoming, the boundaries between person and person, person and thing, are erased as the individual merges with the people and the whole cosmos. As the individual body is transcended, the biological body is negated and the "body of historical, progressing mankind" moves to the centre of the system of images. In the carnival focus on death and rebirth the individual body dies, but the body of the people lives and grows, biological life ends but historical life continues.

The carnivalesque becomes a set of image-borne strategies for destabilising the official worldview. In a recently published article written for inclusion in the Soviet Literaturnaia entsiklopediia (Literary Encyclopaedia) in 1940, Bakhtin defines the satirical attitude as the "image-borne negation" of contemporary actuality as inadequacy, which contains within itself a positive moment in which an improved actuality is affirmed. This affirmed actuality is the historical necessity implicit in contemporary actuality and which is implied by the grotesque image. The grotesque, argues Bakhtin, "discloses the potentiality of an entirely different world, of another order, another way of life. It leads man out of the confines of the apparent (false) unity, of the indisputable and stable" (Rabelais p.48). The grotesque image of the body, as an image which reveals incomplete metamorphosis no longer represents itself, it represents what Hegel called the "universal dialectic of life".

The Renaissance birth of the historical world led to a new development in the Enlightenment. Where Rabelais was presented as the high point of Renaissance literary and philosophical development, the Enlightenment reaches one of its high points in the work of Goethe. The process dispersing the "residue of otherworldly cohesion and mythical unity" was completed at this time, helping "reality to gather itself together and condense into the visible whole of a new world" (Speech Genres and Other Late Essaysp.45). The Enlightenment, argues Bakhtin in a section which draws heavily on Cassirer (the corresponding passage is The Philosophy of the Enlightenment p.197), should no longer be considered an a-historical era, but "an epoch of great awakening of a sense of time, above all ... in nature and human life" (p.26). But, argues Bakhtin "this process of preparing for the disclosure of historical time took place more rapidly, completely, and profoundly in literary creativity than in the abstract philosophical, ideological views of Enlightenment thinkers" (p.26). Goethe's imagination was fundamentally chronotopic, he visualised time in space:

Time and space merge ... into an inseparable unity ... a definite and absolutely concrete locality serves at the starting point for the creative imagination... this is a piece of human history, historical time condensed into space. Therefore the plot (sum of depicted events) and the characters ... are like those creative forces that formulated and humanised this landscape, they made it a speaking vestige of the movement of history (historical time), and, to a certain degree, predetermined its subsequent course as well, or like those creative forces a given locality needs in order to organise and continue the historical process embodied in it. (p.49)

Goethe wanted to "bring together and unite the present, past and future with the ring of necessity" (p.39), to make the present creative. Like Rabelais, Goethe was as much a philosopher as a writer.

The same pattern of analysis shapes the 1963 version of the Dostoyevsky study. Here Dostoyevsky is no longer treated, as in the 1929 version, as a totally original innovator, but as the heir to a tradition rooted in popular culture. The novelist stood poised at the threshold of a new era, as the rigidly hierarchical Russian Empire was poised to give way to the catastrophic arrival of capitalist anarchy and ultimately revolution. Dostoyevsky thus intersected with the threshold poetics of carnival at a different stage in its development, he sought to present the voices of his era in a "pure simultaneity" unrivalled since Dante. In contradistinction to that of Goethe this chronotope was one of visualising relations in terms of space not time and this leads to a philosophical bent that is distinctly messianic:

Only such things as can conceivably be linked at a single point in time are essential and are incorporated into Dostoevskii's world; such things can be carried over into eternity, for in eternity, according to Dostoevskii, all is simultaneous, everything coexists.... Thus there is no causality in Dostoevskii's novels, no genesis, no explanations based on the past, on the influences of the environment or of upbringing and so forth. Every act a character commits is in the present, and in this sense is not predetermined; it is conceived of and represented by the author as free. (p.29)

The roots of such a conception lie in carnival and, according to Bakhtin, in the carnivalised philosophical dialogues that constituted the Menippean Satire. This philosophico-literary genre reaches a new stage in Dostoyevsky's work, where the roots of the novel as a genre stands out particularly clearly. One of those roots was the Socratic Dialogue, which was overwhelmed by the monologic Aristotelian treatise, but which continued to lead a subterranean life in the non-canonical minor satirical genres and then became a constitutive element of the novel form and, implicitly, literary modernism. This accounts for its philosophical importance.

6. Bakhtin's Last Works

In his last years Bakhtin returned to the methodological questions that had preoccupied his earlier years, though now with a rather different perspective. This began with his work on speech genres in the 1950s, though apart from this study, did not yield any sustained texts until the 1970s. Bakhtin now began to stress the dialogic character of all study in the "human sciences", the fact that one needs to deal with another "I" who can speak for and about his or herself in a fundamentally different way than with an inanimate and voiceless object. To this end he sought to differentiate his position from that of incipient Soviet structuralism, which adopted the "abstract objectivist" approach to language and the constitution of the subject. Bakhtin's approach to subjectivity is dialogic, referring to the exchange of utterances rather than narrowly linguistic, and this extends to the analysis of texts which are always intertextual, meeting and illuminating each other. Just as texts have genres, "definite and relatively stable typical forms of construction of the whole" so too does speech. Thus the boundaries between complex genres such as those commonly regarded as literary and other less formalised genres should be seen as porous and flexible, allowing a dialogue of genres as well as styles.

7. Conclusion

The work of the Bakhtin circle is multifaceted and extremely pertinent to contemporary philosophical concerns. Yet their work moves beyond philosophy narrowly defined to encompass anthropology, literary studies, historiography and political theory. The vicissitudes of intellectual life in the Soviet Union have complicated assessment of the work of the circle, as has the way in which the works have been published and translated in recent years. On top of this, the works of the group have been read into a theoretical position framed by present-day concerns over poststructuralism and the fate of the subject in modern philosophy. A proper historical assessment of the work of the Bakhtin Circle will be much aided by the publication of Bakhtin's Complete Works which will appear over the next few years. This will hopefully be followed by a harmonised English translation which will facilitate an informed assessment in the English speaking world.

Author Information

Craig Brandist
University of Sheffield
United Kingdom

Bernard Lonergan (1904—1984)

When we try to reconcile opposing moral opinions we usually appeal to shared ethical principles. Yet often enough the principles themselves are opposed. We may then try to reconcile opposing principles by clarifying how we arrived at them. But since most of our principles are cultural inheritances, discussions halt at a tolerant mutual respect, even when we remain convinced that the other person is wrong. What is needed is a method in ethics that can uncover the sources of error. After all, even culturally inherited principles first occurred to someone, and that someone may or may not have been biased. So there is considerable merit to investigating the innate methods of our minds and hearts by which we construe – and sometimes misconstrue – ethical principles. The work of Bernard Lonergan can guide this investigation. His opus covers methodological issues in the natural sciences, the human sciences, historical scholarship, aesthetics, economics, philosophy and theology. He begins with an invitation to consider in ourselves what occurs when we come to knowledge. He then defines a corresponding epistemological meaning of objectivity. From there he lays out basic metaphysical categories applicable in the sciences. Finally, he proposes a methodical framework for collaboration in resolving basic differences in all these disciplines.

This review will begin by tracing the origins of Lonergan's approach. Following that will be the four steps of a cognitional theory, an epistemology, a metaphysics, and a methodology, particularly as they apply to resolving differences in moral opinions and in ethical principles. Finally, there will be a reexamination of several fundamental categories in ethics.

Table of Contents

  1. Origins
  2. Cognitional Theory
  3. Epistemology (Objectivity)
  4. Metaphysics
    1. Genetic Intelligibility
    2. Dialectical Intelligibility
    3. Radical Unintelligibility
  5. Methodology
  6. Categories
    1. Action, Concepts, and Method
    2. Good and Bad
    3. Better and Worse
    4. Authority and Power
    5. Principles and People
    6. Duties and Rights
  7. Summary
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Major Works of Lonergan
    2. Shorter Works Relevant to Ethics
    3. Other Works

1. Origins

Bernard Lonergan, a preeminent Canadian philosopher, theologian and economist, (1904-1984) was the principal architect of what he named a "generalized empirical method." Born in Buckingham, Quebec, Lonergan received a typical Catholic education and eventually entered the Society of Jesus (Jesuits), leading to his ordination to the priesthood in 1936. He specialized in both theology and economics at this time, having been deeply influenced by his doctoral work on Thomas Aquinas and by his long-standing interest in the philosophy of culture and history, honed by his reading of Hegel and Marx. In the early 1950s, while teaching theology in Toronto, Lonergan wrote Insight: A Study of Human Understanding - his groundbreaking philosophical work. Then, in the early 70s, he published his equally fundamental work, Method in Theology. Throughout his career, he lectured and wrote on topics related to theology, philosophy, and economics. The University of Toronto has undertaken the publication of The Collected Works of Bernard Lonergan, for which 20 volumes are projected.

Lonergan aimed to clarify what occurs in any discipline - science, math, historiography, art, literature, philosophy, theology, or ethics. The need for clarification about methods has been growing over the last few centuries as the world has turned from static mentalities and routines to the ongoing management of change. Modern languages, modern architecture, modern art, modern science, modern education, modern medicine, modern law, modern economics, the modern idea of history and the modern idea of philosophy all are based on the notion of ongoing creativity. Where older philosophies sought to understand unchanging essentials, logic and law were the rule. With the emergence of modernity, philosophies have turned to understanding the innate methods of mind by which scientists and scholars discover what they do not yet know and create what does not yet exist.

The success of the empirical methods of the natural sciences confirms that the mind reaches knowledge by an ascent from data, through hypothesis, to verification. To account for disciplines that deal with humans as makers of meanings and values, Lonergan generalized the notion of data to include the data of consciousness as well as the data of sense. From that compound data, one may ascend through hypothesis to verification of the operations by which humans deal with what is meaningful and what is valuable. Hence, a "generalized empirical method" (GEM).

Lonergan also referred to GEM as a critical realism. By realism, in line with the Aristotelian and Thomist philosophies, he affirmed that we make true judgments of fact and of value, and by critical, he aimed to ground knowing and valuing in a critique of the mind similar to that proposed by Kant.

GEM traces to their roots in consciousness the sources of the meanings and values that constitute personality, social orders, and historical developments. GEM also explores the many ways these meanings and values are distorted, identifies the elements that contribute to recovery, and proposes a framework for collaboration among disciplines to overcome these distortions and promote better living together.

These explorations are conducted in the manner of personal experiments. In Insight and Method in Theology, Lonergan leads readers to discover what happens when they reach knowledge, evaluate options, and make decisions. He expects that those who make these discoveries about themselves reach an explicit knowledge of how anyone reaches knowledge and values, how inquiries are guided by internal criteria, and how therefore any inquiry may be called "objective." Such objectivity implies structural parallels between the processes of inquiry and the structures of what any inquirer, in any place or time, can know and value. Lonergan proposes that these structures, in turn, provide a personally verified clarification of the methods specific to the natural and human sciences, historiography and hermeneutics, economics, aesthetics, theology, ethics, and philosophy itself.

So there are four questions, as it were, that GEM proposes for anyone seeking to ground the methods of any discipline. (1) A cognitional theory asks, "What do I do when I know?" It encompasses what occurs in our judgments of fact and value. (2) An epistemology asks, "Why is doing that knowing?" It demonstrates how these occurrences may appropriately be called "objective." (3) A metaphysics asks “What do I know when I do it?” It identifies corresponding structures of the realities we know and value. (4) A methodology asks, "What therefore should we do?" It lays out a framework for collaboration, based on the answers to the first three questions.

In the following sections, a review of how ethicists familiar with GEM deal with each of these four questions will reveal dimensions that directly affect one's method in ethics.

2. Cognitional Theory

GEM relies on a personal realization that we know in two different manners - commonsense and theoretical. In both we experience insights, which are acts of understanding. In the commonsense mode, we grasp how things are related to ourselves because we are concerned about practicalities, our interpersonal relations, and our social roles. In the theoretical mode, we grasp how things are related to each other because we want to understand the nature of things, such as the law of gravity in physics or laws of repression in psychology. Theoretical insights may not be immediately practical, but because they look at the always and everywhere, their practicality encompasses any brand of common sense with its preoccupation with the here and now.

The theoretical terms defined in GEM should not be confused with their commonsense usage. To take a basic distinction, GEM defines morality as the commonsense assessments and behaviors of everyday living and ethics as the theoretical constructs that shape morality.

Each mode of knowing has its proper criteria, although not everyone reputed to have either common sense or theoretical acumen can say what these criteria are. A recurring theme throughout Lonergan's opus is that the major impediment in theoretical pursuits is the assumption that understanding must be something like picturing. For example, mathematicians who blur understanding with picturing will find it difficult to picture how 0.999... can be exactly 1.000.... Now most adults understand that 1/3 = 0.333..., and that when you triple both sides of this equation, you get exactly 1.000… and 0.999…. But only those who understand that an insight is not an act of picturing but rather an act of understanding will be comfortable with this explanation. Among them are the physicists who understand what Einstein and Heisenberg discovered about subatomic particles and macroastronomical events - it is not by picturing that we know how they function but rather by understanding the data.

Lonergan also notes that philosophers who blur the difference between picturing and the theoretical modes of knowing will be confused about objectivity. When it comes to understanding how the mind knows, they typically picture a thinker in here and reality out there, and ask how one gets from in here to out there - failing to notice that it is not by any picture but by verifying one's understanding of data that the thinker already knows that he or she really thinks.

GEM's goal of a theory of cognition, therefore, is not a set of pictures. It is a set of insights into the data of cognitive activities, followed by a personal verification of those insights. In disciplines that study humans, GEM incorporates the moral dimension by addressing how we know values that lead to moral decisions. So, in GEM's model of the thinking and choosing person, consciousness has four levels - experience of data, understanding the data, judgment that one's understanding is correct, and decision to act on the resulting knowledge. These are referred to as levels of self-transcendence, meaning that they are the principal set of operations by which we transcend the solitary self and deal with the world beyond ourselves through our wonder and care.

GEM builds on these realizations by the further personal discovery of certain innate norms at each of the four levels. On the level of experience, our attention is prepatterned, shifting our focus, often desultorily, among at least seven areas of interest - biological, sexual, practical, dramatic, aesthetic, intellectual, and mystical. On the level of understanding, our intellects pursue answers to questions of why and how and what for, excluding irrelevant data and half-baked ideas. On the level of judgment, our reason tests that our understanding makes sense of experience. On the level of decision, our consciences make value judgments and will bother us until we conform our actions to these judgments. Lonergan names these four innate norming processes "transcendental precepts." Briefly expressed, they are: Be attentive, Be Intelligent, Be reasonable, and Be responsible. But these expressions are not meant as formulated rules; they are English words that point to the internal operating norms by which anyone transcends himself or herself to live in reality. GEM uses the term authenticity to refer to the quality in persons who follow these norms.

Any particular rules or principles or priorities or criteria we formulate about moral living stem ultimately from these unformulated, but pressing internal criteria for better and worse. Whether our formulations of moral stances are objectively good, honestly mistaken, or malevolently distorted, there are no more fundamental criteria by which we make moral judgments. Maxims, such as "Treat others as you want to be treated," cannot be ultimately fundamental, since it is not on any super-maxim that we selected this one. Nor do authorities provide us with our ultimate values, since there is no super-authority to name the authorities we ought to follow. Rather, we rely on the normative criteria of being attentive, intelligent, reasonable and responsible; howsoever they may have matured in us, by which we select all maxims and authorities.

GEM includes many other elements in this analysis, including the roles of belief and inherited values, the dynamics of feelings and our inner symbolic worlds, the workings of bias, the rejection of true value in favor of mere satisfaction, and the commitment to love rather than hate.

3. Epistemology (Objectivity)

GEM may be characterized as a systems approach that correlates the subject's operations of knowing and choosing to their corresponding objects. Hence it understands objectivity as a correlation between the subject's intentionality and the realities and values intended. A subject's intention of objectivity functions as an ideal to be continuously approached. That ideal may be defined as the totality of correct judgments, supported by understanding, and verified in experience. Because our knowledge and values are mostly inherited, objectivity is the intended cumulative product of all successful efforts to know what is truly so and appreciate what is truly good. Clearly, we never know everything real or appreciate everything good. But despite any shortfalls, this principal notion of objectivity - the totality of correct judgments -- remains the recurring desire and the universal goal of anyone who wonders. In GEM's correlation-based, theoretical definition, such objectivity is a progressively more intelligent, reasonable and responsible worldview. Briefly put, an objective worldview is the fruit of subjective authenticity.

Confusion about objectivity may be traced to confusion about knowing. GEM proposes that any investigator who realizes that knowing is a compound of experience, understanding, and judgment may also recognize a persistent tendency to reduce objectivity to only one of these components.

There is an experiential component of objectivity in the sheer givenness of data. In commonsense discourse, we imagine that what we experience through our five senses is really "out there." But we also may refer to what we think is true or good as really "out there." Unfortunately, such talk stifles curiosity about the criteria we use to come to this knowledge. Knowing reality is easily reduced to a mental look. Similarly, the notion of moral objectivity collapses into a property of objects, detached from occurrences in subjects, so that we deem certain acts or people as "objectively evil" or "objectively good," where “objectively” means “out there for anyone to see.” This naiveté about objectivity condenses the criteria regarding the morality of an act to what we picture, overlooking the meanings that the actors attach to the act.

Beyond this experiential component, which bows to the data as "objectively" given, there is a normative component, which bows to the inner norming processes to be attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible. When we let these norms have their way, we raise relevant questions, assemble a coherent set of insights, avoid rash judgments, and test whether our ideas make sense of the data. This normative component is not a property of objects; it is a property of subjects. We speak of it when we say, "You're not being objective" or “Objectively speaking, I say....” It guards us against wishful thinking and against politicizing what should be an impartial inquiry. Still, while this view incorporates the subject in moral assessments, some philosophers tend to collapse other aspects of objectivity into this subjective normativity. For them, thorough analysis, strict logic, and internal coherence are sufficient for objectivity. They propose their structural analyses not as hypotheses that may help us understand concrete experience correctly but as complete explanations of concrete realities. The morality of an act is determined by its coherence with implacable theory, suppressing further questions about actual cases that fall outside their conceptual schemes.

Beyond the experiential and normative components of objectivity, there is an absolute component, by which all inquiry bows to reality as it is. The absolute component lies in our intention to affirm what is true or good independent of the fact that we happen to affirm it. It is precisely what is absent when what we affirm as real or good is not real or good. The absolute component lies neither in the object alone nor the subject alone but in a linking of the two. It exists when the subject's normative operations correctly confirm that the given experiential data meet all the conditions to make the judgment that X is so or Y is good. As a correlation between objective data and subjective acts, it corresponds to Aristotle's understanding of truth as a relation between what we affirm and what really is so. Moralists who collapse knowing into judgment alone typically overlook the conditions set by experience and understanding that make most moral judgments provisional. The result is the dogmatist, out of touch with experience and incapable of inviting others to reach moral judgments by appeal to their understanding.

4. Metaphysics

In popular use, metaphysics suggests a cloud of speculations about invisible forces on our lives. Among philosophers, metaphysics is the science that identifies the basic concepts about the structures of reality. GEM not only identifies basic concepts, but also traces them to their sources in the subject. Thus, concepts issue from insights, and insights issue from questions, and questions have birthdates, parented by answers to previous generations of questions. Moreover, the so-called raw data are already shaped by the questions that occur to an inquirer. These questions, in turn, contain clues to their answers insofar as the insight we expect is related to the kind of judgment we expect. It could be a logical conclusion, a judgment of fact, a judgment that an explanation is correct, or a judgment of value.

Because these complexities of human wonder are part of reality, GEM's metaphysics encompasses the relationship between the processes that guide our wonder and the realities we wonder about. The assumption is that when they operate successfully, the processes of wonder form an integrated set isomorphic to the integral dimensions of reality. For example, the scientific movement from data to hypothesis to verification corresponds to Lonergan's view that knowing moves from experience to understanding to judgment, as well as to Aristotle's view that reality consists of potency, form, and act. In GEM, then, metaphysics comprises both the processes of knowing and the corresponding features of anything that can be known.

This metaphysics is latent but operative before it is conceptualized and named. People who consistently tackle the right question and sidestep the wrong ones already possess latent abilities to discern some structured features of the object of their inquiry. With moral questions, their heuristic anticipations show up as seemingly innate strategies: Don't chisel your moral principles in stone. Consider historical circumstances. A bright idea is not necessarily a right idea. And so forth.

Eventually, these canny men and women may conceptualize and name their latent metaphysics. Should they ask themselves how they ever learned to discern the difference between good thinking and bad thinking, they may look beneath what they think about and wonder how their thinking works. They may realize what GEM takes as fundamental: Any philosophy will rest upon the operative methods of cognitional activity, either as correctly conceived or as distorted by oversights and mistaken orientations. Then, insofar as they correctly understand their cognitional activity, they may begin to make their latent metaphysics explicit.

In the remainder of this article, some of Lonergan's metaphysical terms particularly relevant to ethics are highlighted in bold face.

When we expect to understand anything, our insights fall into two classes. We can understand things as they currently function, or we can understand things as they develop over time. Regarding things as they currently function, we may notice that we have both direct insights and "inverse" insights. These correspond to two different kinds of intelligibilities that may govern what we aim to understand. Lonergan's use of "intelligibility" here corresponds to what Aristotle referred to as "form" and what modern science calls "the nature of."

A classical intelligibility (corresponding to the "classical" scientific insights of Galileo, Newton and Bacon) is grasped by a direct insight into functional correlations among elements. We understand the phases of the moon, falling bodies, pushing a chair - any events that result necessarily from prior events, other things being equal. A statistical intelligibility is grasped by an inverse insight that there is no direct insight available. But while we often understand that many events cannot be functionally related to each other, we also may understand that an entire set of such events within a specific time and place will cluster about some average. For if any subset of events we consider random varies regularly from this average, we will look for regulating factors in this subset, governed by a classical intelligibility to be grasped through a direct insight. Statistical intelligibility, then, does not regard events resulting necessarily from prior events. It regards sets of events, in place P during time T, resulting under probability from multiple and shifting events.

This distinction affects moral appeals to a "natural law." For example, those who hold that artificial birth control is morally wrong typically appeal to a direct, functional relationship between intercourse and conception. However, the nature of this relationship is not one conception per intercourse but the probability of one conception for many acts of intercourse - a relationship of statistical intelligibility. If this is the nature of births, then the natural law allows that each single act of intercourse need not be open to conception.

Regarding things as they develop over time, there are two basic kinds of development, again based on the distinction between direct and inverse insights.

A genetic intelligibility is grasped by a direct insight into some single driving factor that keeps the development moving through developmental phases, such as found in developmental models of stars, plants, human intelligence, and human morality. A dialectical intelligibility is grasped by an inverse insight that there is no single driving factor that keeps the development moving. Instead, there are at least two driving factors that modify each other while simultaneously modifying the developing entity.

These anticipations are key to understanding moral developments. Inquiry into a general pattern of moral development will anticipate a straight-line, genetic unfolding of a series of stages. Inquiry into a specific, actual moral development will anticipate a dialectical unfolding wherein the drivers of development modify each other at every stage, whether improving or worsening.

a. Genetic Intelligibility

Genetic intelligibility is what we expect to grasp when we ask how new things emerge out of old. In this perspective, the metaphysical notion of potency takes on a particularly important meaning for ethics. Potency covers all the possibilities latent in given realities to become intelligible elements of higher systems. What distinguishes creative thinkers is not just their habit of finding uses in things others find useless. They expect that nature brings about improvements even without their help as, for example, when floating clouds of interstellar dust congeal into circulating planets or when damaged brains develop alternate circuits around scar tissue.

In this universe characterized by the potency for successive higher systems, the field of ethics extends to anything we can know. Hence, the "goodness" of the universe lies partly in its potentials for more intelligible organization. Human concern is an instance, indeed a most privileged instance, of a burgeoning universe. A sense of this kind of finality commands respect for whatever naturally comes to be even if no immediate uses come to mind.

An ethics whose field covers universal potentials will trace how morality is about allowing better. It means allowing not only the potentials of nature to reveal themselves but also a maximum freedom to the innate human imperative to do better. It means thinking of any moral option as essentially a choice between preventing and allowing the exercise of a pure desire for the better. Thus, the work of moral living is largely preventive - preventing our neurotic fixations or egotism from narrowing our horizons, preventing our loyalties from suppressing independent thinking, or preventing our mental impatience from abandoning the difficult path toward complete understanding. The rest feels less like work and more like allowing a natural exuberance to a moral creativity whose range has not been artificially narrowed by bias.

In contrast, a commonsense view of the universe imagines only the dimensions studied by physicists. The rule is simple: Any X either does or does not exist. Without this rule, scientists could never build up knowledge of what is and what is not. However, in cases like ourselves, where the universal potency for higher forms has produced responsible consciousness, this rule does not cover all possibilities. We also make the value judgments that some Xs should or should not exist. To recognize that the universe produces normative acts of consciousness is to recognize that the universe is more than a massive factual conglomeration. It is a self-organizing, dynamic and improving entity. Its moral character emerges most clearly with us, in raising moral objections when things get worse, in anticipating that any existing thing may potentially be part of something better, and, sadly, in acting against our better judgment.

Another key metaphysical element within the dynamism of reality toward fuller being is the notion of development. GEM rejects the mechanist view that counts on physics alone to explain the appearance of any new thing. It also rejects the vitalist view that pictures a wondrous life force driving everything from atoms, molecules, and cells, to psyches, minds and hearts. The reality of development, particularly moral development, involves a historical sequence of notions about better and worse. We inherit moral standards, subtract what we think is nonsense and add what we think makes sense. Our inheritance is likewise a sum of our previous generation's inheritance, what they subtracted from it and added to it. Any moral tradition is essentially a sequence of moral standards, each linked to the past by an impure inheritance and to the future by the bits added and subtracted by a present generation.

Not every tradition is a morally progressing sequence, of course, but those that make progress alternate between securing past gains and opening the door to future improvements. GEM names the routines that secure gains a higher system as integrator. It names the routines within the emerged system that open the door to a better system a higher system as operator. Within a developing moral tradition, value judgments perform the integrator functions, while value questions perform the operator functions. The integrating power of value judgments will be directly proportional to the absence of operator functions -- specifically, any further relevant value questions. So we regard some values as rock solid because no one has raised any significant questions about them. Value judgments that are provisional will function as limited integrators - limited, to be exact, to the extent that lingering value questions function as operators, scrutinizing value judgments for factual errors, misconceived theories, or bias in the investigator.

Feelings may function as either operators or integrators. As operators, they represent our initial response to possible values, moving us to pose value questions. As integrators they settle us in our value judgments as our psyches link our affects to an image of the valued object. Lonergan names this linkage of affect and image a symbol. (This is a term that identifies an event in consciousness; it is not to be confused with the visible flags and icons we also call "symbols.") The concrete, functioning symbols that suffuse our psyches can serve as integrator systems for how we view our social institutions, various classes of people, and our natural environment, making it easy for us to respond smoothly without having to reassess everything at every moment. Symbols can also serve as operators insofar as the affect-image pair may disturb our consciousness, alerting us to danger or confusion, and prompting the questions we pose about values.

Although the operators that improve a community's tradition involve the questions that occur to its members, not all questions function as operators. Some value questions are poorly expressed, even to ourselves. We experience disturbing symbols, but have yet to pose a value question in a way that actually results in a positive change. Some value questions are posed by biased investigators, which degrade a community's moral heritage. Only those individuals who pose the questions that actually add values or remove disvalues will function as operators in an improving tradition. What makes any tradition improve, then, is neither the number of cultural institutions, nor governmental support of the arts, nor legal protections for freedom of thought, nor freedom of religion. These support the operators, and need to be regulated as such. But the operators themselves are the questions raised by the men and women who put true values above mere satisfactions.

The same alternating dynamic is evident in the moral development of an individual. While psychotherapists expect that an individual's age is not a reliable measure of moral maturity, those who understand development as an alternation of operators and integrators may pose their questions about a patient's maturity much more precisely: How successfully did this person meet the sequence of operator questions at turning points in his or her life? And what are the resultant integrator symbols guiding this person today? Similarly, in theories of individual development, what counts is what the operators may be at any stage. Where some theorists only describe the various stages, GEM looks for an account of a prior stage as integrator that connects directly to the operator questions to which an emerging stage is an answer.

b. Dialectical Intelligibility

The foregoing genetic model of development gives a gross view of stages and a first approximation to actual development. But actual development is the bigger story. Who we are is a unique weaving of the mutual impacts of external challenges and our internal decisions. So we come to the kind of intelligibility that accounts for concrete historical growth or decline - dialectical intelligibility. We expect this kind of understanding when we anticipate a tension among drivers of development and changes in these very drivers, depending on the path that the actual development takes.

Friendship, for example, has been compared to a garden that needs tending, but the analogy is misleading. What we understand about gardens falls under genetic intelligibility. Seeds will produce their respective vegetables, fruits or flowers; all we do is provide the nutrients. In a friendship, however, each partner is changed with each compromise, accommodation, resistance or refusal. So the inner dynamic of any friendship is a concrete unfolding of two personalities, each linked to the other yet able to oppose the other.

A community, too, is a dialectical reality. Its members' perceptions, their patterns of behavior, their ways of collaborating and disputing, and all their shared purposes are the concrete result of three linked but opposed principles: their spontaneous intersubjectivity, their practical intelligence, and their values.

Spontaneous Intersubjectivity: Our spontaneous needs and wants constitute the primitive, intersubjective dimensions of community. We nest; we take to our kind; we share the unreflective social routines of the birds and bees, seeking one particular good after another.

Practical Intelligence: We also get insights into how to meet our needs and wants more efficiently. We design our houses to fit our circumstances and pay others to build them. In exchange, others pay us to make their bread, drive them to work, or care for their sick. Here is where the intelligent dimensions of a community emerge, comprising all the linguistic, technological, economic, political and social systems springing from human insight that constitute a society.

Values: Where practical intelligence sets up what a community does, values ground why they do it. Here is where the moral dimensions of community emerge - the shoulds and should-nots conveyed in laws, agreements, education, art, public opinion and moral standards. They embody all the commitments and priorities that constitute a culture.

These three principles are linked. Spontaneously, we pursue the particular goods that we need or want. Intellectually, we discover the technical, economic, political and social means to ensure the continuing flow of these particular goods, and we adapt our personal skills and habits to work within these systems. Morally, we decide whether the particular goods and the systems that deliver them actually improve our lives. Yet the principles are forever opposed. Insight often suppresses the urges of passion, while passion unmoored from insight would carry us along its undertow. Conscience, meanwhile, passes judgment on both our choices of particular goods and the systems we set up to keep them coming.

A dialectical anticipation regards a community as a moving, concrete resultant of the mutual conditioning of these three principles. When spontaneous intersubjectivity dominates a community, its members' intellects are deformed by animal passion. When practical intelligence ignores spontaneous intersubjectivity, a society becomes stratified into an elite with its grand plans and a proletariat living from hand to mouth. Where members prefer mere satisfactions over values, intelligences are biased, and deeper human needs for authenticity are ignored. In any case, communities move, pushed and pulled by these principles, now converging toward, now diverting away from genuine progress.

c. Radical Unintelligibility

The idea of development implies a lack of intelligibility, namely, the intelligibility yet to be realized. Likewise, there is a lack of intelligibility in the distorted socio-cultural institutions and self-defeating personal habits that pose the everyday problems confronting us. Yet even these are intelligibly related to the events that created them.

What lacks intelligibility it itself, however, is the refusal to make a decision that one deems one ought to make. GEM follows the Christian tradition of the apostle Paul, of Augustine, and of Aquinas in recognizing the phenomenon that we can act against our better judgment. This tradition is aware that much wrongdoing results from coercion, or conditioning, or invincible ignorance, but it asserts nonetheless that we can refuse to choose what we know is worth choosing. Lonergan refers to these events as "basic sin" to distinguish them from the effects of such refusals on one's socio-cultural institutions and personal habits. Their unintelligibility is radical, in the sense that a deliberate refusal to obey a dictate of one's deliberation cannot be explained, even if, as often happens, later deliberation dictates something else. It is radical also in the etymological sense of a root that branches into the actions, habits and institutions that we consider "bad."

5. Methodology

Different media subdivide ethics in different ways. News media divide it according to the positions people take on moral issues. Many college textbooks divide it into three related disciplines: metaethics (methods), normative ethics (principles), and applied ethics (case studies). This division implies that we first settle issues of method, then establish general moral principles, and finally apply those principles straightaway into practice. GEM proposes that moral development is not the straight line of genetic development nourished solely by principles but rather a dialectical interplay of spontaneous intersubjectivity, practical intelligence, and values. So, instead of a deductive, three-step division of moral process, GEM expects moral reflection to spiral forward inductively, assessing new situations with new selves at every turn. The question then becomes how ethicists might collaborate in wending the way into the future.

In his Method in Theology, Lonergan grouped the processes by which theology reflects on religion into eight specializations, each with functional relationships to the other seven. As illustrated in the chart below, the four levels of human self-transcendence - being attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible – function in the two phases of understanding the past and planning for the future. Thus, we learn about the past by moving upward through research, interpretation, history, and a dialectical evaluation. We move into the future by moving downward through foundational commitments, basic doctrines, systematic organizations of doctrines, and communication of the resulting meanings and values. Our future slips into our past soon enough, and the process continues, turn after turn, reversing or advancing the forces of decline, meeting ever new challenges or buckling under the current ones.

While Lonergan presented this view primarily to meet problems in theology, he extended the notion of functional specialties to ethics, historiography and the human sciences by associating doctrines, systematics, and communications with policies, plans and implementations, respectively. These eight functional specialties are not distinct professions or separate university departments. They represent Lonergan's grouping of the operations of mind and heart by which we actually do better. That is, he is not suggesting a recipe for better living; he is proposing a theoretical explanation of how the mind and heart work whenever we actually improve life, along with a proposal for collaboration in light of this explanation.


The bottom three rows of functions will be initially familiar to anyone involved in practically any enterprise. The top row of functions is less familiar, but it represents Lonergan's clarification of the evaluative moments that occur in any collaboration that improves human living.

The functional specialty dialectic occurs when investigators explicitly sort out and evaluate the basic elements in any human situation. They evaluate the data of research, the explanations of interpreters, and the accounts of historians. To ensure that all the relevant questions are met, they bring together different people with different evaluations with a view to clarifying and resolving any differences that may appear.

From a GEM perspective, the most radical differences result from the presence or absence of conversion. Three principal types have been identified. There is an intellectual conversion by which a person has personally met the challenges of a cognitional theory, an epistemology, a metaphysics, and a methodology. There is a moral conversion by which a person is committed to values above mere satisfactions. And there is an affective conversion by which a person relies on the love of neighbor, community, and God to heal bias and prioritize values.

By attending to these radical differences, GEM rejects the typical liberal assumption that (1) people always lie, cheat and steal; (2) realistically, nothing can be done about these moral shortcomings; and (3) social institutions can do no more than balance conflicting interests. This assumption constricts moral vision to a pragmatism that may look promising in the short run but fails to deal with the roots of moral shortcomings in the long run. Dialectic occurs when investigators explicitly deal with each other's intellectual, moral and affective norms, under the assumption that converted horizons are objectively better than unconverted horizons.

The functional specialty foundations occurs when investigators make their commitments and make them explicit. Relying on the evaluations and mutual encounters that occur in the specialty, dialectic, investigators deliberately select the horizons and commitments upon which they base any proposed improvements. These foundations are expressed in explanatory categories insofar as investigators make explicit their latent metaphysics and the horizons opened by their intellectual, moral and affective conversions.

Regarding ethics, investigators use a number of categories to formulate ethical systems, to track developments, to propose moral standards, and to express specific positions on issues. By way of illustration below, there are six sets of categories that seem particularly important: (1) action, concepts and method, (2) good and bad, (3) better and worse, (4) authority and power, (5) principles and people, and (6) duties and rights.

While commonsense discourse uses these terms descriptively, GEM's theoretical approach defines them as correlations between subjective operations and their objective correlatives. An ethics based on GEM assumes that if science is to take seriously the data of consciousness, then it is necessary to deal explicitly with the normative elements that make consciousness moral. Because these subjective operations include moral norms and because their objective correlatives involve concrete values, the categories will not be empirically indifferent. Their power to support explanations of moral situations and proposals will derive from normative elements in their definitions, which, in turn are openly grounded in the innate norms to be attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible.

6. Categories

a. Action, Concepts, and Method

Interest in method may be considered as a third plateau in humanity's progressive enlargement of what has become meaningful.

  • A first plateau regards action. What is meaningful is practicality, technique, and palpable results.
  • A second plateau regards concepts. What counts are the language, the logic, and the conceptual systems that give a higher and more permanent control over action.
  • The third plateau regards method. As modern disciplines shift from fixed conceptual systems to the ongoing management of change, the success of any conceptual system depends on a higher control over its respective methods.

Morality initially regards action, but it has expanded into a variety of conceptual systems under the heading of ethics. It is these systems, and their associated categories, which are the focus of the third-plateau methodological critique. On the third plateau, concepts lose their rigidity. As long as investigators are explicit about their cognitional theory, epistemology and metaphysics, they will continually refine or replace concepts developed in previous historical contexts.

Although the second plateau emerged from the first and the third is currently emerging from the second, GEM anticipates that any investigator today may be at home with action only, with both action and concepts, or with action, concepts, and method. The effort of foundations is for investigators to include all three plateaus in their investigations. The effort of dialectic is to invite all dialog partners to do the same.

b. Good and Bad

Where second-plateau minds would typically name things good or bad insofar as they fall under preconceived concepts such as heroism or murder, liberation or oppression, philanthropy or robbery, third-plateau minds look to concrete assessments of situations. To ensure that this assessment is sufficiently grounded in theory, GEM requires an understanding of certain correlations between intentional acts and their objects. This requires more than a notional assent to concepts; it requires personally verified insight into what minds and hearts intend and how they intend it.

The relevant correlations that constitute anything called bad or good may be viewed according to the three levels of intentionality that dialectically shape any community. (1) Spontaneously, our interests, actions and passions intend particular goods. (2) Intelligently and reasonably, our insights and judgments intend the vast, interlocking set of systems that give us these particular goods regularly. (3) Responsibly and affectively, our decisions and loves intend what is truly worthwhile among these particular goods and the systems that deliver them.

In authentic persons, affectivity and responsibility shape reasonable and intelligent operations, which in turn govern otherwise spontaneous interests, actions and passions. This hierarchy in intentionality correlates with a priority of cultural values over social systems, and social systems over the ongoing particular activities of a populace. Thus, GEM regards human intelligence and reason as at the service of moral and affective orientations. This turns upside down the view of "materialistic" economic and educational institutions that dedicate intelligence and reason to serving merely spontaneous interests, actions, and passions.

At the same time, moral and affective orientations rely on intelligent and reasonable analyses of situations to produce moral precepts - an approach that contrasts with ethics that look chiefly to virtue and good will for practical guidance. Lonergan demonstrated how intelligent and reasonable analyses produce moral precepts in his works on the economy (Macroeconomic Dynamics: An Essay in Circulation Analysis) and on marriage ("Finality, Love, Marriage").

So GEM regards the concepts of good and bad as useful for expressing moral conclusions, provide they are rooted in intelligent analysis, dialectical encounter, and personal conversion. GEM relies on dialectical encounter to expose the oversights when "good" and "bad" are used to categorize actions in the abstract.

c. Better and Worse

The complexities of one's situation involve not only its history, but the views of history embraced by its participants. Darwinian, Hegelian and Marxist views of history are largely genetic, insofar as they support the liberal thesis that life automatically improves, and that wars, disease, and economic crashes are necessary steps in the forward march of history. GEM declares an end to this age of scientific innocence. It regards this thesis of progress as simply a first of three successively more thorough approximations toward a full understanding of actual situations. A second approximation takes in the working of bias and the resulting dynamics of historical decline. A third approximation takes in the factors of recovery by which bias and its objective disasters may be reversed.

First Approximation: What drives progress. We experience a situation and feel the impulse to improve it. We spot what's missing, or some overlooked potentials. We express our insight to others, getting their validation or refinement. We make a plan and put it into effect. The situation improves, bringing us back to feeling yet further impulses to improve things. The odds of spotting new opportunities grow as, with each turn of the cycle, more and more of what doesn't make sense is replaced by what does. Such is the nature of situations that improve.

Second Approximation: What drives decline. Again, we experience a situation and an impulse to improve it. But we do not, or will not, spot what's missing. We express our oversight to others, making it out to be an insight. If they lack any critical eye, they take us at our word rather than notice our oversight. We make a plan, put it into effect, and discover later the inevitable worsening of the situation. Now the odds of spotting ways to improve things decrease, owing to the additional complexity and cross-purposes of the anomalies. With each turn of the cycle, less and less makes sense. Such is the nature of situations that worsen.

Lonergan proposed that such oversights might be rooted in any of four biases endemic to consciousness: (1) Neurosis resists insight into one's psyche. (2) Egoism resists insight into what benefits others. (3) Loyalism resists insights into the good of other groups. (4) Anti-intellectualism resists insights that require any thorough investigation, theory-based analyses, long-range planning, and broad implementation. In each type, one's intelligence is selectively suppressed and one’s self-image is supported by positive affects that reinforce the bias and by negative affects toward threats to the bias.

Third Approximation: What drives recovery. GEM offers an analysis of love to show how it functions to reverse the dynamics of decline.

  • Love liberates the subject to see values: Some values result not from logical analyses of pros and cons but rather from being in love. Love impels friends of the neurotic and egoist to draw them out of their self-concern, freeing their intelligence to consider the value of more objective solutions. Love of humanity frees loyalists to regard other groups with the same intelligence, reason and responsibility as they do their own. Love of humanity frees the celebrated person of common sense to appreciate the more comprehensive viewpoints of critical history, science, philosophy and theology. Love of a transcendent, unreservedly loving God frees a person from blinding hatred, greed and power mongering, liberating him or her to a divinely shared commitment to what is unreservedly intelligible, reasonable, responsible and loving.
  • Love brings hope: There is a power in the human drama by which we cling to some values no matter how often our efforts are frustrated. Our hopes may be dashed, but we still hope. This hope is a desire rendered confident by love. Those who are committed to self-transcendence trust their love to strengthen their resolve, not only to act against the radical unintelligibility of basic sin, but also to yield their personal advantage for the sake of the common good. Such love-based hope works directly against biased positive self-images as well as negative images of fate that give despair the last word. To feel confident about the order we hope for, we do not look to theories or logic. We rely on the symbols that link our imagination and affectivity. These inner symbols are secured through the external media of aesthetics, ritual, and liturgy.
  • Love opposes revenge: There is an impulse in us to take an eye for an eye, a tooth for a tooth. While any adolescent can see that this strategy cannot be the foundation of a civil society, it is difficult to withhold vengeance on those who harm us. It is the nature of love, however, to resist hurting others and to transcend vengeance. It is because of such transcendent love that we move beyond revenge to forgiveness and beyond forgiveness to collaboration.

GEM's perspective on moral recovery aims to help historians and planners understand how any situation gets better or worse. It helps historians locate the causes of problems in biases as opposed to merely deploring the obvious results. It helps planners propose solutions based on the actual drivers of progress and recovery, as opposed to mere cosmetic changes.

d. Authority and Power

Common sense typically thinks of authority as the people in power. GEM roots the meaning of authority in the normative functions of consciousness and defines the expression of authority in terms of legitimate power.

An initial meaning of power is physical, and physical power is multiplied by collaboration. But in the world of social institutions, a normative meaning of power emerges - the power produced by insights and value judgments. Insights are expressed in words; words raise questions of value; judgments of value lead to decisions; decisions result in cooperation; and this kind of cooperation vastly reduces the physical power needed while achieving vastly better results. The social power of a community grows as it consolidates the gains of the past, restricts behaviors that would diminish the community's effectiveness, organizes labors for specific tasks, and spells out moral guidelines for the future. As normative, the memory and commitments involved in this heritage constitute a community's "word of authority."

The community appoints "authorities" to implement these tasks. Authorities are the spokespersons, delegates, and caretakers of a community's spiritual and material assets. Winning the vote does not confer an authority upon them; it confers a responsibility upon them to speak and embody the community's word of authority. The honor owed to them by titles and ceremony does not derive from any virtue of their persons but rather from the honorable heritage and common purpose with which they have been entrusted.

While the community's social power resides in its ways and means, not all its ways and means are legitimate. A community’s heritage is a mixed bag of sense and nonsense. To the extent that authorities lack the authenticity of being attentive, intelligent, reasonable and responsible, their power to build up is diminished. Even if everyone does what they say, inauthentic authorities will be blind to the higher viewpoints and better ideas needed to stave off chaos and seize opportunities for improving life together. Their power is justifiably called naked because it is stripped of the intelligent, reasonable, and responsible contributions their subjects are quite capable of making. Similarly, to the extent that the subjects lack authenticity, they will cripple their own creativity, which otherwise would foresee problems, overcome obstacles, and open new lines of development. At the extremes, a noble leader of egotistical followers has no more effective power than an egotistical leader of noble followers. Between these extremes, the typical dynamic is an ongoing dialectic between an incomplete authenticity of the community and an incomplete authenticity of its authorities.

In this concrete perspective, GEM defines authority as power legitimated by authenticity. That is, authority is that portion of a heritage produced by attention, intelligence, reason, and responsibility. As only a portion of a heritage, authority is a dialectical reality, to be worked out in mutual encounter, rather than a dictatorial iron law (a classical reality), an anarchical or libertarian social order (a statistical reality), or a natural, evolutionary dynasty (a genetic reality).

This definition of authority as the power legitimated by authenticity offers historians defensible explanations for their distinctions between legitimate and illegitimate exercises of power within a historical period. It offers policymakers the normative categories they need to explain to their constituents the reasons for proposed changes in the community's constitution, laws, and sanctions. It reminds authorities that they have been entrusted with the maintenance and refinement of a heritage created by the community.

e. Principles and People

A commonsense use of "moral principles" usually means any set of conceptualized standards, such as, “The punishment should fit the crime" or "First, do no harm.”

When ethicists consider how moral principles should be used, disagreements arise. Some scorn them because principles are only abstract generalizations that do not apply in concrete situations. When we try to apply them, disputes arise about the meaning of terms such as "crime" or "harm." Particular cases always require further value judgments on the relative importance of mitigating factors, which generalizations omit. What counts is a thorough assessment of the concrete situation, which will result in an intuition of what seems best.

Others reject such situation-based ethics because people have different intuitions about what seems best in particular situations. What is needed is a general principle that supports the common good. Moreover, history proves that formulated principles are good things. Because they represent wisdom gained by others who met threats to their well being, to neglect them is to unknowingly expose oneself to the same threats. We codify principles in our laws, appeal to them in our debates, and teach them to our children. For children in particular, and for adults whose moral intelligence has not matured, principles are firm anchors in a stormy sea.

GEM regards principles as concepts that need the critique of a third-plateau reflection on the methods used to develop them. They are not really principles in the sense of starting points. That is, they are not the source of normative demands. The actual sources of normative demands are self-transcending people being attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible. Formulated principles are the products of people shaped by an ambiguous heritage, exposed to a dialectic of opinions, and directed by personal commitments within intellectual, moral and affective horizons. These horizons may complement each other; they may develop from earlier stages; or they may be dialectically opposed, as when people who mouth the same principles attach opposite meanings to them, or when people espouse the principle but act otherwise.

GEM grants no exception for moral principles proposed by religions. A religious revelation is considered neither a delivery from the sky of inscribed tablets nor a dictation heard from unseen divinities. In its data of consciousness perspective, GEM considers revelation as a person's judgment of value regarding known proposals, whether inscribed or spoken or imagined. Its religious sanction is based on a person's claim that this judgment is prompted by a transcendent love from a transcendent source in his or her heart.

Those who formulate specific moral principles need to understand that there are distinct methodological issues associated with each of the eight specialties that form a group in consciousness. This understanding begins with men and women who think about their intellectual, moral and affective commitments in explanatory categories (foundations). It is first expressed in these categories as judgments of fact or value (doctrines/policies). It expands through understanding the relationships these principles have with other principles (systematics/planning). It becomes effective thorough adaptations that take into account the current worldview of a community, the media used, and the values implicit in the community's language (communications/implementation). These adaptations become data (research) for further understanding (interpretation) within historical contexts (history) to be evaluated (dialectic.)

GEM's strategy for resolving differences among principles is to exercise the functional specialty dialectic to reveal their true source. Investigators evaluate not only the historical accounts of how any principle arose, but also the principle itself. GEM proposes that where investigators overcome disagreements, the parties have lain open their basic horizons, particularly the intellectual, moral and affective horizons that reveal the radical grounds of disagreements and agreements. In this mutual encounter, people concerned about morality are already familiar with normative elements in their consciousness and may only lack the insights and language to make them intelligible parts of how they present their views. The strategy is not to prove one's principle or disprove another's but to tap one another's experience of a desire for authenticity. GEM counts on the probability that those people with more effective intellectual, moral and affective horizons will, by laying bare the roots of any differences, attract and guide those whose horizons are less effective.

Besides people who appreciate authenticity, there are people who crave its opposite, as the history of hatred amply demonstrates. If GEM has accurately identified the dialectic of decline as driven by an increasingly degraded authenticity, with its increasingly narrow and unconnected solutions to problems, then the reversal of moral evil must appeal to any remnants of authenticity in the hater. The appeal involves enlargements of horizons at many levels. For communities of hatred, this enlargement will require moving from legends about their heritage to a critical history, revising the rhetoric and rituals that secure commitment, and rewriting their laws. At the same time, there is also an enlargement to be expected of the communities who seek to convert communities of hatred. This is because more comprehensive political protocols and moral standards will be required to achieve a yet higher integration of those portions of both heritages that resulted from authenticity.

f. Duties and Rights

In the perspective of GEM, the elemental meaning of duty is found in the originating set of "oughts" in the impulses to be attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible, plus the overriding "ought" to maintain consistency between what one knows and how one acts. The oughts issued by conscience not only provide all the norms expressed in written rules, but also issue far more commands and prohibitions than parents, police, and public policy ever could. It is this inner duty that enables one to break from a minor authenticity that obeys the written rule and to exercise a major authenticity that may expose a written rule as illegitimate.

At first glance, the GEM view of morality may appear sympathetic to "deontological" theories that base all moral obligation on duty rather than consequences. While it is true that GEM traces all specific obligations to an underlying, universal duty, it goes deeper than concept-based maxims by identifying the dynamic originating duty in every person to be attentive, intelligent, reasonable and responsible. By tracing the source of any maxims about duty to their historical origins, GEM leaves open the possibility that new historical circumstances may require new maxims.

Moreover, insofar as any formulations of duty are consequences of past historical situations, and as new formulations will be consequences of new situations, GEM supports the consideration of consequences in ethical theory. What this approach adds, however, is the requirement that all consequences pass under the scrutiny of dialectic, which aims to filter merely satisfying consequences from the truly valuable, and to consider how specific consequences contribute to historical progress, decline, or recovery. These consequences include not only changes in observable behaviors and social standards but also any shifts in the intellectual, moral and affective horizons of a community.

As adults juggle their customary duties to social norms and their originating duty to be authentic, many discover that the best parts of these social norms arose from the authenticity of forebears. With this discovery comes a recognition of a present duty to preserve those portions of one's heritage based on authenticity, to critique those portions based on bias, and to create the social and economic institutions that facilitate authenticity.

Lonergan depicted such preservation, critique, and creativity as an ongoing experiment of history. The success of the race, and of any particular peoples, depends on collaborative efforts to conduct this experiment rather than serve as its guinea pigs. Collaboration, in turn, requires authenticity of all collaborators.

Any collaboration that successfully makes life more intelligible will require a freedom to speak one's mind, to associate, to maintain one's health, and to be educated. The notion of human rights, therefore, is a derivative of this intelligibility intrinsic to nourishing a heritage. While "rights" usually appear as one-way demands by one party upon others, their essential meaning is that they are expressions of the mutual demands intrinsic to any collaborative process aimed at improving life. Any individual's claim in the name of rights is essentially an assumption that others will honor his or her duty to contribute to the experiment to improve a common heritage.

Conflicts of rights are often the ordinary conflicts involved in any compromise. More seriously, they may be differences between plateaus of meaning among a community's members. First-plateau minds, focused on action, will think of rights as the behaviors and entitlements that lawmakers allow to citizens. Many will conclude that they have a right to do wrong. In contrast, GEM views lawmakers as responsible for protecting the liberty of citizens to live authentically. Thus, while the law lets every dog have a free bite, GEM repudiates the conclusion that anyone has a right to do wrong.

Second-plateau minds promote the ancient and honorable notion that rights are a set of immutable, universal properties of human nature. GEM considers that the strength of the modern notion of rights has been based mainly on logical consistency and permanent validity. However, from the methods perspective of the third plateau of meaning, GEM also recovers elements in the ancient notion of natural right that include personal authenticity and defines these elements in terms of personal conversion. On that basis, GEM proposes a collaborative superstructure driven by the functional specialties, dialectic and foundations.

In any case, GEM considers rights as historically conditioned means for authentic ends. As historically conditioned means, rights may take any number of legal and social forms. So, for example, the historical expansion from civil rights (speech, assembly, suffrage) to social rights (work, education, health care), to group rights (women, homosexuals, ethnic groups) is evidence of the ongoing emergence of new kinds of claims on each other's duty to replenish a heritage. As oriented toward authentic ends, the validity of any rights claim depends on how well it enables authentic living, a question addressed through the mutual exposures that occur in the functional specialty dialectic. Consequently, ethicists familiar with GEM rely less on the language of rights and more on the language of dialog, encounter, and heritage.

7. Summary

A generalized empirical method in ethics clarifies the subject's operations regarding values. The effort relies on a personal appropriation of what occurs when making value judgments, on a discovery of innate moral norms, and on a grasp of the meaning of moral objectivity. These innate methods of moral consciousness are expressed in explanatory categories, to be used both for conceptualizing for oneself what occurs regarding value judgments and for expressing to others the actual grounds for one's value positions.

GEM is based on a gamble that the odds of genuine moral development are best when the players lay these intellectual, moral and affective cards on the table. Concretely, this implies a duty to acknowledge the historicity of one's moral views as well as a readiness to admit oversights in one's self-knowledge. Moreover, given the proliferation of moral issues that affect confronting cultures with different histories today, it also implies a duty to meet the stranger in a place where this openness can occur.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Main Works of Lonergan

  • Insight: A Study of Human Understanding. Volume 3 of the Collected Works of Bernard Lonergan. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1997. Originally published 1957.
  • Method in Theology. New York: Herder & Herder, 1972.
  • "Cognitional Structure," Collection. Montreal: Palm, 1967, pp 221-239.
  • "Dimensions of Meaning," Ibid., pp 252-267.
  • "The Subject," A Second Collection. London: Darton, Longman & Todd, 1974, pp. 69-87.
  • Macroeconomic Dynamics: An Essay in Circulation Analysis. Volume 15 of the Collected Works of Bernard Lonergan. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1999.

b. Shorter Works Relevant to Ethics

  • "Finality, Love, Marriage." Collection, op. cit., pp 16-55.
  • "The Example of Gibson Winter," A Second Collection, op. cit., pp 189-192.
  • "The Dialectic of Authority," A Third Collection. New York: Paulist Press, 1985, pp 5-12.
  • "Method: Trend and Variations," ibid., pp 13-22.
  • "Healing and Creating in History," ibid., pp. 100-109.
  • "The Ongoing Genesis of Methods," ibid., pp. 146-165.
  • "Natural Right and Historical Mindedness," ibid., pp. 169-183.
  • "Lectures on Existentialism," Part Three of Phenomenology and Logic: The Boston College Lectures on Mathematical Logic and Existentialism, Volume 18 of the Collected Works of Bernard Lonergan, op.cit., pp. 219-317.

c. Other Works

  • Melchin, Kenneth R. Living with Other People. Ottawa: St. Paul University Press, 1998.
  • Morelli, Mark D. and Morelli, Elizabeth A. The Lonergan Reader. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1997.

Author Information

Tad Dunne
U. S. A.

Aztec Philosophy

aztecConquest-era Aztecs conceived philosophy in essentially pragmatic terms. The raison d'etre of philosophical inquiry was to provide humans with practicable answers to what Aztecs identified as the defining question of human existence: How can we maintain our balance while walking upon the slippery earth? Aztec philosophers addressed this question against an assumed metaphysics which held that the cosmos and its human inhabitants are constituted by and ultimately identical with a single, vivifying, eternally self-generating and self-regenerating sacred energy. Knowledge, truth, value, rightness, and beauty were defined in terms of the aim of humans maintaining their balance as well as the balance of the cosmos. Every moment and aspect of human life was meant to further the realization of this aim.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. Who were the Aztecs?
    2. Sources for Studying Nahua Thought
    3. The Approach of This Study
  2. Nahua Metaphysics
    1. Teotl as Ultimate Reality and Root Metaphor
    2. Dialectical Polar Monism
    3. Pantheism
    4. Teotl as Self-Transforming Shaman and Artist
    5. Teotl as Root Metaphor
    6. Popular Aztec Religion
    7. Living in the "House of Paintings"
    8. Time-Space
  3. The Defining Problematic of Nahua Philosophy
    1. How Can Humans Maintain their Balance on the Slippery Earth?
    2. The Character of Wisdom
  4. Epistemology
    1. The Raison d'etre of Epistemology
    2. Truth as Well-Rootedness and Alethia
    3. Cognitive Burgeoning and Flowering
    4. "Flower and Song"
  5. Intrinsic Value: Balance and Purity
  6. Morality: Living in Balance and Purity
  7. Aesthetics
  8. Conclusion
  9. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

a. Who were the Aztecs?

The indigenous peoples of Mesoamerica enjoy a long and rich tradition of philosophical speculation. The Aztecs and other Nahuatl-speaking peoples of the High Central Plateau of Mexico were no exception. Nahuatl-speaking peoples originated in northern Mexico and southwestern United States, migrating south in successive waves to the central Mexican highlands during the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries. Nahuatl is a member of the Uto-Aztecan linguistic family and related to Ute, Hopi, and Comanche. Nahuatl-speakers included among others the Mexicas (known to us but not to themselves as "Aztecs"), Texcocans, Chalcans, and Tlaxcaltecs. Due to their common language and culture, scholars standardly refer to Nahuatl-speakers as "Nahuas", and to their culture, as "Nahua culture". I follow this practice here. Nahua culture flourished in the fifteenth- and sixteenth- centuries prior to 1521 (CE), the fall of the Aztec capital, Tenochtitlan, and official date of the Conquest.

b. Sources for Studying Nahua Philosophy

Our sources for studying Conquest-era Nahua philosophy include: (1) native pictorial histories, ritual almanacs, tribute records, and maps, including the Codex Mendoza (painted several years after the Conquest), Codex Borgia (painted shortly before the Conquest), and Codex Borbonicus (painted about the time of the Conquest); (2) reports of the Spanish conquerors (e.g. Hernando Cortes and Bernal Diaz del Costillo); (3) ethnography-style works composed by missionaries (e.g. Friars Olmos, Motolinia, Sahagun, Duran and Mendieta) entering Mexico shortly after the Conquest -- most notably Sahagun's encyclopedic Historia General de