Category Archives: Value Theory

Resource Bounded Agents

Resource bounded agents are persons who have information processing limitations. All persons and other cognitive agents who have bodies are such that their sensory transducers (such as their eyes and ears) have limited resolution and discriminatory ability; their information processing speed and power is bounded by some threshold; and their memory and recall is imperfect in some way. While these general facts are not controversial, it is controversial whether and to what degree these facts should shape philosophical theorizing.

Arguably, resource bounded agents pose the most serious philosophical challenges to normative theories in a number of domains, and especially to theories of rationality and moral action. If a normative theory endorses a standard for how an agent ought act or think, or if a normative theory aims to provide recommendations for various kinds of conduct, such a theory will have commitments regarding the descriptive facts about the agent’s cognitive limitations. There are two major responses. These theories may either (1) argue to dismiss these descriptive facts as irrelevant to the normative enterprise (see section 2) or, instead, (2) attempt to accommodate these facts in some way (see section 3). Historically, normative theories that have attempted to accommodate facts about cognitive limitations have done so by either (i) augmenting the proposed normative standard, or (ii) using facts about cognitive limitations to show that agents cannot meet the proposed normative standard.

After a brief discussion of some empirical work addressing human cognitive limitations, this article will discuss idealization in philosophy and the status of the normative bridge principle "ought implies can," which suggests that "oughts" are constrained by descriptive limitations of the agent. Next, the article explores several theories of rationality that have attempted to accommodate facts about cognitive limitations.

As an introductory and motivating example, consider the claim that human agents ought not to believe inconsistent propositions. Initially, such a claim seems perfectly reasonable. Perhaps this is because a collection of inconsistent propositions is guaranteed to include at least one false proposition. But Christopher Cherniak (1986) has pointed out that when one has as few as 140 (logically independent) beliefs, there are approximately 1.4 tredecillion (a number with 43 digits) pairs of beliefs to check for potential inconsistency. No human could ever check that many items for consistency. In fact, an ultra-fast supercomputer would take 20 billion years to complete such a task. Hence, for some epistemologists, the empirical fact of the impossibility of a complete consistency-check of a human’s belief corpus has provided reason for thinking that complete consistency of belief is not an appropriate normative standard. Whether such a response is ultimately correct, however, concerns the status of resource bounded agents in normative theorizing.

Table of Contents

  1. Cognitive Limitations and Resource Bounds
    1. Limitations of Memory
    2. Limitations of Visual Perception
    3. Limitations of Attentional Resources
  2. Idealization
    1. Idealization Strategies
    2. Problems with the Idealization Strategy
    3. Ought Implies Can
  3. Accommodating Cognitive Limitations
    1. Changing the Normative Standard
      1. Simon's "Satisficing View" of Decision Making
      2. Pollock's "Locally Global" View of Planning
      3. Cherniak's "Minimal Rationality" and "Feasible Inferences"
      4. Gigerenzer's "Ecological Rationality"
    2. Failing to Meet the Standard
      1. Kahneman and Tversky's "Heuristics and Biases" Program
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. References
    2. Further Reading

1. Cognitive Limitations and Resource Bounds

Every known cognitive agent has resource and cognitive limitations. Christopher Cherniak refers to this necessary condition as the "finitary predicament": because agents are embodied, localized, and operate in physical environments, they necessarily face informational limitations. While philosophers have acknowledged this general fact, the precise details of these resource and cognitive limitations are not widely discussed, and the precise details could matter to normative theorizing. Revisiting the example from above, it is obvious that humans cannot check 1.4 tredecillion pairs of beliefs for consistency. But it is not obvious how many beliefs a human agent can check. If it could be experimentally demonstrated that humans could not occurrently check twelve beliefs for consistency, even this minimal consistency check might not be rationally required. Hence, the precise details of cognitive limitations need to be addressed.

Before turning to the details of cognitive limitations, it is important to note that there are two senses of the term 'limitation'. To see the distinction, consider a simple example. Very young children are limited in their running abilities. This limitation can be described in two ways: (i) young children cannot run a mile in under four minutes, and (ii) young children are not excellent runners. The important difference in these (true) descriptions is that way (i) uses non-normative language and way (ii) uses normative language. This distinction is crucial when the main objective is an evaluation of the normative standard itself. For instance, challenging whether (i) is true involves non-normative considerations while challenging whether (ii) is true fundamentally involves normative considerations. As such, the kinds of cognitive limitation under discussion in this article will primarily concern non-normative limitations.

In what follows, this article will survey some findings from cognitive psychology to illustrate various attempts to measure human cognitive limitations. These findings are not exhaustive and should be thought of as representative examples.

a. Limitations of Memory

Memory is the general process of retaining, accessing, and using stored information. Short-term memory is the process of storing small amounts of information for short periods of time. In 1956 George Miller published a paper that helped measure the limitations of human short-term memory. This paper was an early example of the field that would later be known as cognitive psychology. In "The Magical Number Seven, Plus or Minus Two", Miller argued that short-term memory is limited to approximately seven items (plus or minus two). That is, Miller argued that for typical adult humans, short-term memory is bounded by about nine items. Later work such as Cowan (2001) has suggested that the capacity of short-term memory might be smaller than previously thought, perhaps as small as four items.

In some ways, Miller’s result should be puzzling. Humans are often able to recite long sentences immediately after reading them, so how would this ability square with Miller’s experimental results? Miller also introduced the idea of "chunking" in his famous 1956 paper. To "chunk" items is to group them together as a unit (often by a measure of similarity or meaningfulness). This is an information compression strategy. For example, suppose the task is to remember the following eight words: catching, dog, apples, city, red, frisbees, park, yellow. Likely, this would be somewhat difficult. Instead, suppose the task was to remember the four phrases: yellow dog, red apples, catching frisbees, city park. This should be less difficult, even though the task still involves eight words. The explanation is that the eight items have been "chunked" down to four informational items (to be "uncompressed" later when needed). Yet, the existence of chunking strategies does not mean that short-term memory is unbounded. Typical humans cannot remember more than seven (plus or minus two) chunks, nor is it the case that just any string of information can be chunked. For many subjects, it would be exceedingly difficult to chunk the following eight strings of letters: rucw, mxzq, exef, cfiw, uhss, xohj, mnwf, ofhn.

Long-term memory is the process of storing information for long periods of time. Long-term memory also features kinds of limitation. It may be tempting to think that stored memories are like photographs or video, which may be retrieved and then reviewed as an unaltered representation of an event. But this is not how human memory works. Psychologists have known for a long time that many aspects of memory are "constructive". That is, factors such as expectation, experience, and background knowledge can alter memories. Humans are prone to omit details of events and even add details that never occurred. Consider the classic example of Bartlett's "War of the Ghosts" experiment. In 1932 Fredrick Bartlett read British subjects a story from aboriginal Canadian folklore. He then asked the subjects to recall the story as accurately as they were able. This established a baseline of subject performance. Next, Bartlett used the experimental technique of "repeated reproduction" and had subjects retell the story after longer and longer periods of time. Bartlett found that as more time passed, subjects' retelling of the story became shorter and more and more details were omitted. As well, many subjects added details to the story that reflected their own culture, rather than the cultural setting of the story. As one example, instead of recalling the canoes that were mentioned in the story, many subjects retold the story as concerning boats, which would be more familiar to a British participant.

It has also been demonstrated that for some kinds of information, retrieving an item from memory can reduce the likelihood of successfully retrieving a competing or related item. As a simple example, trying to remember where one last put one's keys would be much more difficult if competing memories such as where one put the keys two days ago or three days ago were just as likely to be recalled. Instead, it appears as though there is an inhibitory mechanism that suppresses the recall of competing memories (in this case, the older "key location" memory). While potentially beneficial in some respects, this "retrieval-induced forgetting" effect might be harmful in some academic settings. Macrae and MacLeod (1999) gave subjects 20 "facts" about a fictional island. Next, subjects were evenly divided into two groups: group one practiced memorizing only a select 10 of the 20 facts and group two did not practice memorizing any of the 20 facts. Unsurprisingly, group one had better recall than group two on the select 10 facts. But, interestingly, group two had better recall than group one on the other 10 facts. That is, by attempting to memorize some subset of the 20 facts, group one had impoverished recall in the unpracticed subset of facts. This result might have implications for students that attempt to cram for an exam: in cramming for an exam, students may reduce their performance on unstudied material.

In addition to the above limitations, humans also suffer from age related performance decreases in memory. Humans also typically have difficulty in remembering the source of their information (that is, how they initially learned the information). Further, misinformation and suggestion can alter subjects' memories and even create "false memories". Eyewitness reports of a crime scene may omit relevant information when a gun is present (known as "weapon focus"), due to the narrow attentional focus on the gun. As well, subtle feedback to an eyewitness report (for example, a police officer says "thanks for helping identify the perpetrator") can strengthen the eyewitness' feeling of confidence, but not their reliability.

b. Limitations of Visual Perception

Humans are able to visually detect wavelengths between roughly 400 and 700 nanometers, corresponding to colors from violet to red. Hence, unaided human vision cannot detect much of the information in the electromagnetic spectrum, including infrared and ultraviolet radiation. Under ideal conditions, humans can discriminate between wavelengths in the visible spectrum that differ by only a few nanometers.

It is a mistake to think that, for humans, the entire visual field is uniformly detailed. This is surprising, because it seems (phenomenologically, at least) that most of the visual field is detail rich. Recall the experience of studying the brushstrokes of an artwork at approximately five feet of distance. The uncritical experience suggests that vision always provides highly detailed information—perhaps this is because everywhere one looks there appears to be detail. Yet, there is a sense in which this is an illusion. In the human eye, the fovea is responsible for providing highly detailed information, but the fovea is only a small part of the retina. Eye movements, called saccades, change the location of foveal vision to areas of interest, so details can be extracted where they are wanted. Much of the visual field in humans does not provide detail rich information, and might be described in lay terms as being similar to "peripheral vision". This non-foveal part of the visual field has limited acuity and results in impoverished perceptual discriminatory ability.

Just as it is incorrect to think that memory works like a photograph, human color vision does not simply provide the color of an object in the way a "color picker" does in a image editing computer program. The color an object appears is often highly sensitive to the amount of light in the environment. Color judgments in humans can be highly unreliable in low light environments, such as when distinguishing green from purple. Human vision is also subject to color constancy in some circumstances. Color constancy occurs when objects appear to stay the same color despite changing conditions of illumination (which change the wavelengths of light that are reflected) or because of their proximity to other objects. For instance, the green leaves of a tree may appear to stay the same color as the sun is setting. Color constancy may be helpful for the tracking or re-identification of an object through changing conditions of illumination, but it may also increase the unreliability of color judgments.

c. Limitations of Attentional Resources

Attention is the capacity to focus on a specific object, stimulus, or location. Many occurrent cognitive processes require attentional resources. Lavie (1995, 2005) has proposed a model that helps explain the relationship between the difficulty of various tasks and the ability to successfully deploy attentional resources. Lavie's idea is that total cognitive resources are finite, and difficult cognitive tasks take up more of these resources. A direct implication is that comparatively easier tasks allow for available cognitive resources to process "task-irrelevant" information. Processing task-irrelevant information can be distracting and even reduce task performance. For an example of this phenomenon, consider the difference between taking an important final exam and casually reading at a coffee shop. Applying Lavie's model, taking an important final exam will often use all of one's cognitive resources, and hence, no task-irrelevant information (such as the shuffling of papers in the room or the occasional cough) will be processed. In this particular instance, the task-irrelevant stimuli cannot be distracting. In contrast, causally reading at a coffee shop typically is not a "high-load" task and does not require most of a subject's cognitive resources. While reading casually one can still overhear a neighboring conversation or the sound of the espresso machine, sometimes hindering the ability to concentrate on one's book.

As an example of competition from task-irrelevant stimuli, consider the well-known Stroop effect. First conducted by J.R. Stroop in 1935, the task is to name as quickly as possible the color of ink used to print a series of words. For words such as 'dog', 'chair' and 'house', each printed in a different color, the task is relatively easy. But Stroop had subjects read words such as 'green', 'blue', and 'red' printed in non-representative colors (so 'red' might be printed in blue ink). This version of the task is much more challenging, often taking twice as much time as the version without color words. One explanation of this result is that the task-irrelevant information of the color word is difficult to ignore, perhaps because linguistic processing of words is often automatic.

Attentional resources are also deployed in tracking objects in the environment. Object-based attention concerns representing and tracking objects. Xu et al. (2009) report that due to limits on processing resources, the visual system is able to individuate and track about four objects. Sears and Pylyshyn (2000) also cite limits on the capacity to process visual information and have shown that subjects are able to track about five identical objects in a field of ten objects.

2. Idealization

This section will discuss one dismissive response to problems posed by resource bounded agents. The basic idea behind this response is that descriptive facts about cognitive limitations are irrelevant to the normative enterprise.

a. Idealization Strategies

In drafting various normative theories (concerning, for example, rational belief or moral action), some philosophers have claimed to be characterizing "ideal" agents, rather than "real" or "non-ideal" agents like humans (where real or non-ideal agents are those agents that have cognitive limitations). This strategy can be defended on a number of lines, but one defense appeals to theory construction in the physical sciences. In drafting physical theories it is often helpful to first begin with theoretically simple constraints and add in complicating factors later. For instance, many introductory models about forces omit mention of complicating factors such as friction, air resistance, and gravity. Likewise, a philosopher might claim that the proper initial subject of normative theorizing is the ideal agent. As such, descriptive details of the cognitive limitations of non-ideal agents are simply not relevant to initial theorizing about normative standards, because ideal agents do not have cognitive limitations. Yet, the thought is, theories of ideal agents might still be useful for evaluating non-ideal agents. Continuing with the analogy with scientific models, the proposed strategy would be to first determine the normative standard for ideal agents, and then evaluate non-ideal human agents as attempting to approximate this standard.

As one example of this strategy, return to the issue of believing inconsistent propositions. Because ideal agents do not have memory or computational limitations, these agents are able to check any number of beliefs for inconsistency. It then seems that these agents ought not to believe inconsistent propositions. Perhaps the reason for this is that one ought not to believe false propositions, and a set of inconsistent propositions is guaranteed to have at least one false member. This result might serve as one dimension of the normative standard. Now, turning attention to resource bounded agents such as humans, it might be thought that these agents ought to try to approximate this standard, however imperfectly. That is, the best reasoners imaginable will not believe inconsistent propositions, so humans ought to try to approximate the attitudes or behaviors of these reasoners. On this view, better human reasoners believe fewer inconsistent propositions.

A second defense of the idealization strategy appeals directly to the kinds of concepts addressed by normative theories. Many normative concepts appear to admit of degrees. It might be thought that there can be better and worse moral decisions and better and worse epistemic attitudes (given a collection of evidence). If this is correct then, plausibly, ideal agents might be thought to be the best kind of agent and correspondingly the proper subject for normative theorizing. Consider the following example. Suppose a person witnesses an unsupervised child fall off a pier into a lake. In a real case, the human observer might feel paralyzing stress or anxiety about the proper response and thus momentarily postpone helping the child. Such a response may seem less than optimal—it would be better if the agent responded immediately. Considering these optimal responses might necessarily involve imagining ideal agents, because (plausibly) every real agent will have some amount of stress or anxiety. Because ideal agents do not have psychological limitations, an ideal agent would not become paralyzed by stress or anxiety and would respond immediately to the crisis. In this regard, after abstracting away from complicating factors arising from human psychology, ideal agents might help reveal better moral responses.

As briefly mentioned above, idealization strategies often offer a bridge principle, linking the proposed normative standard to real human action and judgment. Of course, human agents are not ideal agents, so how do ideal normative standards apply to real human agents? One common answer is that human agents ought to try to approximate the ideal standards, and better agents more closely approximate these standards. For instance, it is clear that no human agent could achieve a pairwise check of all of their beliefs for logical consistency. But it still might be the case that better agents check more of their beliefs for consistency. Plausibly, young children check few of their beliefs for consistency whereas reflective adults are careful to survey more of the claims they endorse for consistency and coherence. On this measure it is not obviously unreasonable to judge the reflective adult as more rational than the young child.

b. Problems with the Idealization Strategy

One potential problem with the idealization strategy is the threat of incoherence. If every cognitive agent is physically embodied, then every cognitive agent will face some kinds of resource limitation. Hence, it is unclear that ideal agents are either physically possible or even conceivable. What kind of agents are ideal cognizers anyway? Do ideal cognizers even reason or make inferences, given the immediate availability of their information? Should we really think of them as reasoners or agents at all? Ideal cognizers are certainly unlike any cognitive agent with which we've ever had any experience. As such, the thought is that little weight should be placed on claims such as "ideal agents are able to check any number of beliefs for inconsistency", because it is not clear such agents are understandable.

An idealization theorist might respond by leaning on the analogy with model construction in the physical sciences. Introductory models of forces that omit friction, say, may describe or represent physically impossible scenarios but these models nonetheless help reveal actual structural relationships between force, mass, and acceleration (for instance). Perhaps, so too for normative theorizing about ideal agents.

A second potential problem with the idealization strategy concerns possible disanalogies between theorizing in philosophy and the physical sciences. Introductory models of forces in the physical sciences do not yield ultimate conclusions. That is, the general relationship between force and mass that is established in idealized models is later refined and improved upon with the addition of realistic assumptions. These updated models are thought to be superior, at least with respect to accuracy. In contrast, however, many philosophers who claim to be theorizing about ideal agents take their results to be either final or ultimate. As previously mentioned, some epistemologists take belief consistency to be a normative ideal, and adding realistic assumptions to the model does not produce normatively better results. If such a stance is taken, then this weakens the analogy with theory construction in the physical sciences.

A third potential problem with the idealization strategy is that it is not clear that there are unique ideal agents or even unique idealized normative standards. Why should we think that there is one unique ideally rational agent or one unique ideally moral agent, rather than a continuum of better agents (perhaps just as there is no possible fastest ideal marathon runner)? The worry is clear in this respect: if there are only better and better agents (with no terminally best agent) then the study of any particular idealized agent cannot yield ultimate normative standards. It is also not clear that there are always unique idealized normative standards. For instance, it is often assumed that there are optimal decisions or optimal plans for ideal agents to choose. Yet, John Pollock (2006) has argued that there is "no way to define optimality so that it is reasonable to expect there to be optimal plans". The consequence of this result, if it can be maintained, is that there is no unique optimal plan or set of plans that an ideal agent could choose. Hence, an idealization strategy, one that abstracts away from time and resource constraints on the agent, could not represent ideal plans. It is more controversial as to whether there are optimal belief states that ideal reasoners would converge to, given unbounded time and unbounded cognitive resources.

c. Ought Implies Can

A fourth potential problem with the idealization strategy concerns the well-known and controversial "ought implies can" principle. If true, this principle states that the abilities of the agent constrain normative demands or requirements on the agent. Consider an example from the moral domain. Suppose that, after an accident, a ten ton truck has pinned Abe to the ground and is causing him great harm. Ought a fellow onlooker, Beth, lift the truck and free Abe? Many would claim that because Beth is unable to lift the truck, she has no duty or obligation to lift the truck. In other words, it might seem reasonable to think that Beth must be able to lift the truck for it to be true that she ought to lift the truck. There may well be other things that Beth ought to do in this situation (perhaps make a phone call or comfort Abe), but the idea is that these are all things that Beth could possibly do.

If "ought implies can" principles are true in various normative domains such as ethics or epistemology, then the corresponding idealization strategy would face the following problem. Idealization strategies, by definition, abstract away from the actual abilities of agents (including facts about memory, reasoning, perception, and so forth). Hence, these strategies will not produce normative conclusions that are sensitive to the actual abilities of agents, as "ought implies can" principles require. Hence, idealization strategies are defective.

Said differently, "ought implies can" principles suggest that descriptive facts matter to normative theorizing. As Paul Thagard (1982) has said, epistemic principles "should not demand of a reasoner inferential performance which exceeds the general psychological abilities of human beings". Of course, idealization strategies necessarily disagree with this claim. If "ought implies can" principles are true then we have reason to reject idealization strategies.

Are "ought implies can" principles true? Intuitively, the Abe and Beth case above seems plausible and reasonable. This provides prima facie evidence that there is something correct about a corresponding moral "ought implies can" principle in the moral domain. However, in epistemology, there are reasons to think that "epistemic oughts" do not always imply "epistemic cans".

In defending evidentialism, Richard Feldman and Earl Conee (1985) have argued that cognitive limits do not always constrain theories of epistemic justification. As they say, "some standards are met only by going beyond normal human limits". Feldman and Conee give three examples. The first concerns a human agent whose doxastic attitude a best fits her evidence e, but forming a is beyond the agent’s "normal cognitive limits". To fill in the details, suppose that the doxastic attitude that best fits Belinda’s evidence is believing that her son is guilty of the crime, but also suppose that Belinda is psychologically unable to appropriately assess her evidence (given its disturbing content). Feldman and Conee think that the intuitive response to such a case would be to think that (believing in guilt) "would still be the attitude justified by the person’s evidence", even though in this case Belinda faces the impossible task of assessing her evidence. Indeed, it seems that this is a standard response one might have toward family members of guilty defendants: given the evidence, they ought to believe that their loved one is guilty, despite its impossibility. If such a response is correct, then "ought implies can" principles are not always true in epistemic domains.

The second and third examples Feldman and Conee give are the following:

Standards that some teachers set for an "A" in a course are unattainable for most students. There are standards of artistic excellence that no one can meet, or at least standards that normal people cannot meet in any   available circumstance.

These latter examples are surely weaker than the first. It would be completely unreasonable for a teacher to adopt a standard for an "A" that was impossible for any student to satisfy ("to get an "A" a student must show that 0 = 1"). However, part of the difficulty here is that the relevant notion of "can" is either vague or ambiguous. Does "can" mean some students could satisfy the standard some times? Or does "can" mean that at least one student could satisfy the standard once? It would not be unreasonable for a teacher to adopt a standard for an "A" that one particular class of students could not attain. The art example is even more difficult. First, the art example is unlike the Abe pinned under the truck example. In that case it was physically impossible for Beth to lift the truck. The art example, however, contains a standard that "normal people cannot meet in any available circumstance", with the implication that some humans can meet the standard. The difference between these examples is that one is indexed to Beth's abilities and the other is indexed to human artistic abilities, generally. The worry is that some standards might be "community standards" and hence the relevant counterexample would be a case where no one in the community could meet the standard. Indeed, it would be an odd artistic standard such that no possible human could ever satisfy it.

Lastly, it is unclear whether Feldman and Conee's remarks can be generalized to other normative domains. Even if Feldman and Conee are correct in thinking that various "epistemic oughts" do not imply "epistemic cans", it is not obvious whether similar considerations hold in the domain of morality or rational action.

3. Accommodating Cognitive Limitations

The second major kind of response to resource bounded agents is to accommodate the descriptive facts of cognitive limitations into one's normative theory. Proponents of this response claim that facts about cognitive limitations matter for normative theories. To continue with the example of believing inconsistent propositions, a theorist that adopted a version of this response might attempt to argue that resource bounded agents ought not to believe "feasibly reached" or, instead, "obvious" inconsistent propositions. This response would accommodate facts about cognitive limitations by relaxing the standard "never believe any set of inconsistent propositions".

There are two ways in which one might attempt to accommodate cognitive limitations into one's normative theorizing. First, similar to the above example, one might "change the normative standard" and argue that resource bounded agents show that normative standards should be relaxed in some way. Versions of this response will be discussed in section 3a. Second, one might instead argue that cognitive limitations show that the agents being investigated cannot meet the proposed normative standard, and hence, are inherently defective in some dimension. This response will be discussed in section 3b.

a. Changing the Normative Standard

In this subsection, the article discusses several prominent views that accommodate descriptive facts about cognitive limitations by augmenting or changing normative standards.

i. Simon's "Satisficing View" of Decision Making

One way to accommodate the cognitive limitations that agents face is to relax the traditional normative standards. In the domain of rational decision making, Herbert Simon (1955, 1956) replaced the traditional "optimization" view of the rationality of action with the more relaxed "satisficing" view. To illustrate the difference between optimization procedures and satisficing procedures, consider the well-known "apartment finding problem". Presumably, when searching for an apartment one values several attributes (perhaps cost, size, distance from work, quiet neighborhood, and so forth). How ought one choose? The optimization procedure recommends maximizing some measure. For example, one way to proceed would be to list every available apartment, assess each apartment's total subjective value under the various attributes, determine the likelihoods of obtaining each apartment, and then calculate this "weighted average" and choose the apartment that optimizes or maximizes this measure. Simon noticed that such an optimization procedure is typically not feasible for humans: it is too computationally demanding. For one, the complete information about apartment availability or even complete information about apartment attributes is often unavailable. Secondly, the relevant probabilities are crucial to an optimization strategy, but these probabilities are too cognitively demanding for typical human agents. For example, what is the probability that apartment B will still be available if the initial offer for apartment A gets rejected? How would one calculate this probability? Instead, Simon suggests that humans ought to make decisions by "satisficing", or deciding to act when some threshold representing a "good enough", but not necessarily best or optimal, outcome is achieved. To satisfice in the apartment finding problem, one determines some appropriate threshold or aspiration level of acceptability (representing "good enough"), and then one searches for an apartment until this threshold is reached. A satisficer picks the first apartment that surpasses this threshold.

It is important to note that, under a common interpretation, Simon is not recommending the satisficing procedure as a next best alternative to the optimization procedure. Instead, Simon is suggesting that the satisficing procedure is the standard by which to judge rational action. Correspondingly, human agents who do not optimize in the sense described above are not normatively defective qua rational decision maker.

One claimed advantage of satisficing over optimization concerns computational costs. A satisficing strategy is thought to be less computationally intensive than an optimization strategy. Optimization strategies require the computation of "expected values" based on a network of probabilities and subjective values, and also the computational resources to store and compare these values. Satisficing strategies, by contrast, only require that an agent is able to compare a possible choice with a threshold value, and there is no need to store past assessments (other than the fact that a past choice was assessed). A second advantage of satisficing is that it seems to come close to describing how humans actually solve many decision problems and, as well, appears to be predictively successful. For better or worse, humans do seem to pick apartments, cars, perhaps even mates that are "good enough" rather than optimal (and note that someone like Simon would say this is "for the better").

Two criticisms of satisficing concern its stability over time and the setting of satisficing thresholds or aspiration levels. A benefit of the optimization procedure is that an agent can be confident that her decision is the best in a robust sense—in comparison with any other alternative, the optimal option will be superior to this alternative. However, if one picks option a under a satisficing procedure, one cannot be confident that option a will be superior to any other future alternative option b. In fact, one cannot be confident that the next alternative option is not better than the current option. This is potentially problematic in the following sense. If one sets one's satisficing threshold too low, one may quickly find a choice that surpasses this threshold, but is nonetheless unacceptable in a more robust sense. For example, buying the first car one sees on the sales lot is often not recommended, however easy this strategy is to follow. In this example the threshold for "good enough" is clearly too low. This leads to the second broad criticism. When factoring in the calculation needed to determine how low or high to set the satisficing threshold, it is not obvious whether satisficing procedures retain their computational advantage. As previously mentioned, a satisficing threshold that recommends buying the first car one sees on the sales lot is too low. But what threshold should count as representing a "good enough" car? In most cases this is a difficult question. Intuitively, a "good enough" car is one that has some or many desirable features. But is this a probabilistic measure—must these desirable features be known to obtain with the choice selection or are they merely judged to be probable? Further, how does one compute the relationship between some particular feature of the car and its desirability? The worry is that setting appropriate satisficing thresholds is as difficult as optimizing. Serious concern with these kinds of issues puts pressure on the claim that satisficing procedures have clear computational advantages.

ii. Pollock's "Locally Global" View of Planning

John Pollock is also critical of optimization strategies for theories of rational decision making, for reasons concerning cognitive limitations. However, rather than focus on the rationality of individual decision problems (such as the apartment finding problem or the car buying problem mentioned above), Pollock's view concerns rational planning. To see the difference between individual decision problems and planning problems, consider the following example. In deciding what to do with one’s afternoon, one might decide to go to the bank and go to the grocery store. By deciding, one has solved an individual decision problem. However, there are two important issues that are still unresolved for the decision: (1) how to implement the decisions "go to the bank" and "go to the grocery store" (go by car or by bus or walk?) and (2) how to structure the order of individual decisions (go to the bank first, then go to the grocery store second?). Planning generally concerns the implementation and ordering issues illustrated in both (1) and (2). When agents engage in planning they attempt to determine what things to do, how to do them, and how to order them.

Planning is often regarded as more broad than the field of "decision theory", which typically focuses on the rationality of individual actions. Research in artificial intelligence concerning action almost exclusively focuses on planning. One reason for this focus is that many AI researches want to build agents that operate in the world, and operating in the world requires more than just deciding whether to perform some particular action. As illustrated above, there are often many ways to perform the same action (one may "go to the bank" by traveling by car or by boat or by jet pack). As well, actions are performed in temporal sequence with other actions, some of which potentially conflict (for example, if the bank closes at 4pm, then it is impossible to go to the bank after one goes to the grocery store).

Now, how ought rational agents to plan? One suggestion is that rational agents choose optimal plans, in a way similar to the optimization procedure mentioned in section 3ai above. An optimal plan is a plan that maximizes some measure (such as expected utility, for example). A simple version of a plan-based optimization procedure might include the following: (i) survey all possible plans and (ii) choose the plan that maximizes expected utility. Many of the claimed virtues for the optimization procedure of individual decisions discussed in section 3ai above also count as virtues of the plan-based optimization procedure.

John Pollock has argued that real, non-ideal agents ought not use plan-based optimization procedures. Part of his argument shares reasons given by Herbert Simon: resource bounded agents such as humans cannot survey and manage the information required to optimize. Further, Pollock responds to this situation in a similar way to Simon. Rather than claim that informational resource limitations show that humans are irrational, Pollock argues that the correct normative standard is actually less demanding and can be satisfied by human agents.

One feature of Pollock's argument is similar to Christopher Cherniak’s (1986) observation about the inherent informational complexity of a complete consistency check on one's belief corpus. Pollock argues that because plans are constructed by adding parts or "sub-plans", the resulting complexity is such that it is almost always impossible to survey the set of possible plans. For example, suppose an agent considers what plan to adopt for the upcoming week. In a week, an agent might easily make over 300 individual decisions, and a plan will specify which decision to implement at each time. Further, suppose that there are only 2 alternative options for each individual decision. This entails that there are 2^300 possible plans for the week to consider, or, approximately 10^90 plans, a number greater than the estimated number of elementary particles in the universe. Obviously, human agents cannot survey or even construct or represent the set of possible plans for a week of decisions. Actually, the situation is much worse. Rational planning includes what things to do, how to do them, and how to order them, and additionally what may be called "contingency plans". One might adopt a plan to drive to the airport on Sunday, but this plan might also include the contingency plan "if the car won't start, call a taxi". Optimization procedures would require selecting the maximally best contingency plans for a given plan (it would typically not be recommended to try to swim to the airport if one's car won't start), but additionally surveying and constructing the set of all possible contingency plans only furthers the computational complexity problem with the optimization procedure.

Instead of optimization, Pollock argues that non-ideal human agents should engage in "locally global" planning. Locally global planning involves beginning with a "good enough" master plan (an idea Pollock acknowledges is reminiscent of Simon's satisficing view), but continually looking for and making small improvements to the master plan. As Pollock claims, "the only way resource bounded agents can efficiently construct and improve upon master plans reflecting the complexity of the real world is by constructing or modifying them incrementally". The idea is that resource bounded agents ought to defeasibly adopt a master plan which is "good enough", but continually seek improvements as new information is obtained or new reasoning is conducted.

iii. Cherniak's "Minimal Rationality" and "Feasible Inferences"

Chistopher Cherniak’s (1986) Minimal Rationality is a seminal work in the study of resource bounded agents, and it discusses the general issue of the relationship between cognitive limitations and normative standards. He begins by arguing against both idealized standards of rationality ("finitary" agents such as humans could never satisfy these conditions) and a "no standards" view of rationality (unlike agents we recognize, such agents would never generate any predictions on their behavior). The third alternative, that of "minimal rationality" suggests "moderation in all things, including rationality". Cherniak claims that many of the minimal rationality conditions can be derived from the following principle:

(MR) If A has a particular belief-desire set, A would undertake some, but    not necessarily all, of those actions that are apparently appropriate.

For example, Cherniak is clear in suggesting that rational agents need not eliminate all inconsistent beliefs. This generates the following "minimal consistency condition":

(MC) If A has a particular belief-desire set, then if any inconsistencies        arose in the belief set, A would sometimes eliminate some of them.

In support of (MC), Cherniak argues that non-minimal, ideal views of rationality (ones that suggest agents ought to eliminate all inconsistencies) would actually entail that humans are irrational. As he claims, "there are often epistemically more desirable activities for [human agents] than maintaining perfect consistency". The idea is that given the various cognitive limitations that humans face (the "finitary predicament"), it would be irrational for any human to attempt to satisfy the Sisyphean task of maintaining a consistent belief corpus.

There are two prominent objections to Cherniak’s minimal consistency condition. First, as Daniel Dennett and Donald Davidson have pointed out in various works, it is difficult to understand or ascribe any beliefs to agents that have inconsistent beliefs. For instance, suppose that Albert believes that p, and that p entails q, but also suppose that Albert believes that q is false. What is Albert's view of the world? In one sense, it may be argued that Albert has no view of the world (and hence no beliefs) because, ultimately, Albert might be interpreted as believing both q and ¬q, and there is no possible world that could satisfy such conditions. In response, Cherniak invokes an "ought implies can" principle. He suggests that once an agent meets a threshold of minimal rationality, "the fact that a person's actions fall short of ideal rationality need not make them in any way less intelligible to us". As such, Cherniak's response could be understood in a commonsense way: typical human agents have some inconsistent beliefs, but we nonetheless ascribe beliefs to them.

A second objection to Cherniak's minimal consistency condition concerns the permissiveness of the condition. As Appiah (1990) has worried, "are we left with constraints that are sufficiently rich to characterize agency at all"? As an example, an agent that eliminates a few inconsistent beliefs only on Tuesdays would satisfy (MC). Yet there is something intuitively defective about such a reasoner. Instead, it seems that what is wanted is a set of constraints on reasoners, reasoning, and agency that are more strict and more demanding than Cherniak's minimal rationality conditions. Perhaps anticipating objections similar to Appiah's, Cherniak developed what he calls a theory of "feasible inferences". A theory of feasible inferences recruits descriptive facts about cognitive limitations to provide more restrictive normative requirements. For instance, a theory of "human memory structure" describes what information is cognitively available to human agents, given various background conditions. In general terms, when information is cognitively available to an agent, more normative constraints are placed on the agent. Correspondingly, conditions such as (MC) would thereby be strengthened.

However, it is unclear whether a theory of human memory structure will provide enough detail to propose a "rich structure of constraints" on rationality or agency. For one, Cherniak's theory of human memory structure describes typical humans. There is even a sense in which "typical human" is an idealized notion since no individual is a typical human. Given that there are individual differences in memory abilities between humans, which constraints should be adopted? If an inference to q is obvious for Alice but it would not be obvious for a typical human, is Alice required to believe q (on pain of irrationality) or is it merely permissible for her to believe q? Note that proponents of idealization strategies (as discussed in section 2) are able to provide a rich structure of constraints and do not have to worry about individual differences in cognitive performance.

iv. Gigerenzer's "Ecological Rationality"

Gerd Gigerenzer views rationality as fundamentally involving considerations of the agent's environment and the agent's cognitive limitations. Similar to many of the theorists discussed above, Gigerenzer also cites Herbert Simon as an influence. Many aspects of Gigerenzer's view may be understood as responding to the influential project of psychologist Daniel Kahneman, to which this article will turn next.

Gigerenzer (2006) is clear in his rejection of "optimization" views of rationality, which he sometimes calls "unbounded rationality". As he claims,

. . . it is time to rethink the norms, such as the ideal of omniscience. The   normative challenge is that real humans do not need. . . unlimited computational power.

In place of optimization procedures, Gigerenzer argues that resource bounded agents ought to use "heuristics" which are computationally inexpensive and are tailored to the environment and abilities of the agent (and are, hence, "fast and frugal"). Rationality, for Gigerenzer, consists in the deployment of numerous, however disparate, fast and frugal heuristics that "work" in an environment.

To understand Gigerenzer's view, it is helpful to consider several of his proposed heuristics. For the first example, consider the question of who will win the next Wimbledon tennis championship. One way to answer this question, perhaps in line with the optimality view of rationality, would be to collect vast amounts of player performance data and make statistical predictions. Surely, such a strategy is computationally intensive. Instead, Gigerenzer suggests that in some cases it would be rational to use the following heuristic:

Recognition Heuristic: If you recognize one player but not the other, then infer that the recognized player will win the particular Wimbledon match.

First, the recognition heuristic is obviously computationally cheap—it does not require informational search or deep database calculations, or the storage of large amounts of data. Second, the recognition heuristic is incredibly fast to deploy. Third, this heuristic is not applicable in all environments. Some agents will not be able to use this heuristic because they do not recognize any tennis player, and some agents will not be able to use this heuristic because they recognize every tennis player. Fourth, it is essential to note that proper use of the recognition heuristic, in Gigerenzer's view, results in a normatively sanctioned belief or judgment. That is, when agents use the recognition heuristic in the appropriate environment, the resulting belief is rational. For instance, if Mary only recognizes Roger Federer in the upcoming match between Federer and Rafael Nadal, then it is rational for her to believe that Federer will win.

Some may find this last result surprising or counterintuitive—after all, Mary may know very little about tennis, so how can she have a rational belief that a particular player will win? Gigerenzer would reply that such surprise or counterintuitiveness probably results from holding an optimality view of rationality. Gigerenzer's project is an attempt to argue that rationality does not consist in gathering large amounts of information and making predictions on this basis. Rather, Gigerenzer thinks that rationality consists in using limited amounts of information in efficient or strategic ways, with the caveat that the proper notion of efficiency and strategy are not idealized notions, but concern the agent's cognitive limitations and environment.

Now turn to the important question: does the recognition heuristic work? Gigerenzer (2007) found that in approximately 70% of Wimbledon matches, the recognition heuristic predicted the winning player. That is, for agents that are "partially ignorant" about tennis (those that know something about tennis but are not experts) the recognition heuristic gives better-than-chance predictive success.

Consider another heuristic. Humans need to track objects in the environment such as potential threats and sources of food. One way to track an object would be to calculate its trajectory using properties of force, mass, velocity and a series of differential equations. Some AI systems attempt to do just this. It is clear that humans do not explicitly solve differential equations to track objects, but it is also not obvious that humans do this even at a subconscious or automatic level. Gigerenzer (2007) proposes that humans use a "gaze heuristic" in specific situations. For example, consider the problem of tracking an oncoming plane while flying an airplane. One way to infer where an approaching plane will be is to use a series of mathematical formulae involving trajectories and time. A second way would be to use the following gaze heuristic:

Gaze Heuristic: Find a scratch or mark in your airplane windshield. If the   other plane does not move relative to this mark, dive away immediately.

As with the recognition heuristic, the gaze heuristic is computationally cheap and fast. Further, this heuristic is not liable to induce calculation errors (as may be the case with the mathematical equations strategy).

Gigerenzer has also argued that a version of the gaze heuristic is used by outfielders when attempting to catch fly balls. This heuristic consists of the following instructions: fix your gaze on the ball, start running, and adjust your running speed so that the image of the ball rises at a constant rate. Interestingly, Shaffer et al. (2004) attached a small camera to dogs when they were fetching thrown frisbees, and it appears that dogs may too use the gaze heuristic. If so, a plausible explanation seems fitting with Gigerenzer's proposal: in the face of resource limitations, many agents use inference strategies that are fast and frugal, and work in their environment.

One initial worry for Gigerenzer's project of finding fast and frugal heuristics is that it is not clear there are enough heuristics to explain humans' general rationality. If a non-expert correctly infers that an American will hit the most aces during Wimbledon, was this an inference based on the recognition heuristic (it is not obvious that it must be), or is there an additional heuristic that is used (perhaps a new heuristic that only concerns aces hit in a tennis match)? Gigerenzer is clear in his rejection of "abstract" or "content-blind" norms of reasoning that are general purpose reasoning strategies, but his alternative view may be forced to posit a vast number of heuristics to explain humans' general rationality. Further, a cognitive system that is able to correctly deploy and track a vast number of heuristics does not obviously have a clear computational advantage.

A second worry concerns the "brittleness" of the proposed heuristics. For instance, referencing the above mentioned recognition heuristic, what ought one to infer in the case of a tennis match where the recognized player becomes injured on court? Of course, the recognition heuristic is not adaptable enough to handle this additional information (with the idea being that injured players, however excellent, are typically unlikely to win). So, there may be instances in which it is rational to override the use of a heuristic. But positing a cognitive system that monitors relevant additional information and judges whether and when to override the use of a specific heuristic might erase much of the alleged computational advantages that heuristics seem to provide.

b. Failing to Meet the Standard

This article will now address the remaining response by theorists to accommodate the facts of cognitive limitations into their normative theorizing. Some philosophers and psychologists have used facts about cognitive limitations to argue that humans fail to meet various normative standards. For instance, one might argue that humans' inherent memory limitations and corresponding inability to check beliefs for logical consistency entail that humans are systematically irrational. One might argue that humans' inherent inability to survey all relevant information in a domain entails that all humans are systematically deluded in that domain. Or, concerning morality, one might attempt to argue that cognitive limitations entail that humans must be systematically immoral, because no human could ever make the required utility calculations (of course, under the assumption of a particular consequentialist moral theory).

Though all of the example positions in the above paragraph are somewhat simplistic, they all roughly share the following features: (i) the claim of a somewhat idealized or "difficult to obtain" normative standard and (ii) the claim that facts about cognitive limitations are relevant to the normative enterprise and show that agents cannot meet this normative standard. As a quick review of material covered in previous sections, theorists such as Herbert Simon, John Pollock, Christopher Cherniak, and Gerd Gigerenzer would reject feature (i), because, in very general terms, they have argued that cognitive limitations provide reason for thinking that the relevant normative standards are not idealized and are not "difficult to obtain". Proponents of the idealization strategy, such as many Bayesians in epistemology, would reject (ii), because they view the cognitive limitations of particular cognitive agents as irrelevant to the normative enterprise.

i. Kahneman and Tversky's "Heuristics and Biases" Program


Daniel Kahneman and Amos Tversky are responsible for one of the most influential research programs in cognitive psychology. Their basic view is that human agents reason and make judgments by using cognitive heuristics, and that these heuristics produce errors. Hence the label "heuristics and biases". Though Kahneman and Tversky have taken a nuanced position regarding the overall rationality of humans, others such as Piatelli-Palmarini (1994) have argued that work done in the heuristics and biases program shows that humans are systematically irrational.

Before discussing some of Kahneman and Tversky's findings, it is important to note two things. First, though both Gigerenzer and Kahneman and Tversky use the name "heuristics", these theorists plausibly mean to describe different mechanisms. For Gigerenzer, reasoning heuristics are content-specific and are typically tied to a particular environment. For Kahneman and Tversky, heuristics are understood more broadly as a "shortcut" procedure for reasoning or as a reasoning strategy that excludes some kinds of information. Notoriously, Gigerenzer is critical of Kahneman and Tversky's characterization of heuristics, claiming that their notion is too vague to be useful. Second, Gigerenzer and Kahneman and Tversky evaluate heuristics differently. For Gigerenzer, heuristics are normatively good (in situations where they are “ecologically rational”), and they are an essential component of rationality. Kahneman and Tversky, however, typically view heuristics as normatively suspect since they likely lead to error.

To begin, consider Kahneman and Tversky's heuristic of "representativeness". As they say, "representativeness is an assessment of the degree of correspondence between a sample and a population, an instance and a category, an act and an actor or, more generally, between an outcome and a model". By using the representativeness heuristic, for one example, a subject might infer that a typical summer day is warm and sunny because it is a common and frequent event, and hence, representative.

Kahneman and Tversky claim that the representativeness heuristic drives some proportion of human probability judgments. They also claim that the use of this heuristic for probability judgments leads to systematic error. In one experiment Tversky and Kahneman (1983) gave subjects the following description of a person and then asked them a probability question about this description. This is the well-known "Linda the bank teller" description: "Linda is 31 years old, single, outspoken and very bright. She majored in philosophy. As a student, she was deeply concerned with issues of discrimination and social justice, and also participated in anti-nuclear demonstrations". Next, Kahneman and Tversky asked subjects which of the two statements was more probable (given the truth of above description): (T) Linda is a bank teller, or (T&F) Linda is a bank teller and is active in the feminist movement. Kahneman and Tversky report that approximately 85% of subjects judge (T&F) as more probable than (T). Before discussing the alleged incorrectness of this judgement, why might subjects make this judgment? The thought is that, given the description of Linda being an activist in social justice movements and perhaps a philosophy major, (T&F) is more representative of Linda than (T). If Kahneman and Tversky are right in thinking that representativeness drives judgment about probabilities, then their model could explain the result of the Linda case.

But ought agents to judge that (T&F) is more probable than (T), given the description of Linda? This is the important normative question. Kahneman and Tversky rely on the probability calculus as providing the normative standard. According to many versions of the probability calculus, prob(a) ≥ prob(a&b), regardless of the chosen a or b. This may be called "the conjunction rule" for probabilities. The basic idea is that a narrower or smaller class of objects is never more probable than a larger class, and that the overlap of two classes cannot be larger than one of the individual classes. For example, which class is larger, the class of all trucks (Tr) or the class of all white trucks (W&Tr)? Clearly, the answer is the class of all trucks, because every white truck is also a truck. So, which is more probable, that there is a truck parked in front of the White House right now (Tr) or that there is a white truck parked in front of the White House right now (W&Tr)? Plausibly, it is more likely that there is a truck parked in front of the White House (Tr), because any white truck is also a truck, and hence would also count toward the likelihood of there being a truck parked there.

Kahneman and Tversky appeal to the probability calculus as providing the normatively correct rule of reasoning for the Linda case. Because 85% of subjects responded that (T&F) was more probable than (T), against the conjunction rule, Kahneman and Tversky claim that most subjects made an incorrect judgment. So, on their view, this is a case where resource limitations cause human agents to use shortcut procedures such as the representativeness heuristic, and the representativeness heuristic gets the wrong answer. Hence, the representativeness heuristic is responsible for a cognitive bias.

The alleged cognitive bias in the Linda case provides just one part of Kahneman and Tversky's overall program of heuristics and biases. They have argued that human subjects make errors with insensitivity to prior probabilities, insensitivity to sample size, misconceptions of chance, and misconceptions of regression. Importantly, these claims rely on the probability calculus as providing the correct normative standard. But should we think that the probability calculus provides the correct normative standard for rationality?

One straightforward reason to think that the probability calculus provides the correct normative standard for rational belief concerns logical consistency. Violation of the standard axioms of the probability calculus entails a set of inconsistent probabilistic statements. As such, degrees of belief that satisfy the probability calculus are often called “coherent” degrees of belief. For reasons similar to those given in the introduction to this article, it is often thought that it is not rational to believe a set of inconsistent propositions. Hence, it seems rational to obey the probability calculus.

However, there are significant worries with thinking that the probability calculus provides the correct normative standard for rationality. First, following the rules of the probability calculus is computationally demanding. Independent of Kahneman and Tversky’s experimental results, we should anticipate that few humans would be able to maintain coherent degrees of probabilistic belief, for reasons of computational complexity alone. This observation would entail that humans are not rational, yet this goes against our commonsense view that humans are often quite rational. Indeed, it might be difficult to explain how we're able to predict human behavior without the corresponding view that humans are usually rational. Insofar as our commonsense view of human rationality is worth preserving, we have reason to think that the probability calculus does not provide a correct normative standard.

A second worry concerns tautologies. According to standard interpretations of probability, every tautology gets assigned probability 1. But if the probability calculus provides a normative standard for belief, then it is rational for us to believe every tautology (for any set of evidence e). But this seems wrong. There are many complex propositions that are difficult to parse or interpret or even understand, but are nonetheless tautologies. Until one recognizes these propositions as instances of a tautology, it does not seem rational to believe just any tautology.

A third and final worry concerns the psychological nature and phenomenology of belief. If the probability calculus provides the correct normative standard for belief then most of our contingent beliefs (for example, “the coffee cup is on the desk”) will have a precise numerical probability assignment, and this number will be less than 1. Call beliefs that are less than 1 but greater than 0.5 “likely beliefs”. Many of our familiar contingent beliefs will be likely beliefs (hence, getting some number assignment such as 0.99785), but it is unclear that our cognitive systems would be able to store or even compute vast amounts of probabilistic information. Belief seems to not work this way. There are, of course, projects in artificial intelligence that attempt to model similar probabilistic systems, but their results have not been universally convincing. Secondly, the phenomenology of belief suggests that many of our contingent beliefs are not “graded” entities that admit of some number, but are binary or “full” beliefs. When one believes that “the coffee cup is on the desk” it often feels like one “fully” believes it, rather than merely “partially” believing it (as would be required if the belief were assigned probability 0.99785). As an example, when reasoning about contingent matters of fact, we often treat our beliefs as full beliefs. Hence, the following reasoning seems both commonplace and acceptable, and does not require probabilities: “I think the coffee cup is in the office, so I should walk there to get the cup”. Hence, the phenomenology of belief gives a possible reason to doubt that the probability calculus provides the correct normative standard for belief.

4. References and Further Reading

a. References

  • Appiah, Anthony. (1990). "Minimal Rationality by Christopher Cherniak." The Philosophical Review, 99 (1): 121–123.
  • Bartlett, Fredrick C. (1932). Remembering: A Study in Experimental and Social Psychology, Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
  • Cherniak, Christopher. (1986). Minimal Rationality, Cambridge, MIT Press.
    • An important work in the study of resource bounded agents. Discusses idealization in theories of rationality and conditions for agenthood.
  • Cowan, N. (2001). "The Magical Number 4 in Short-Term Memory: A Reconsideration of Mental Storage Capacity." Behavioral Brain Science, 24: 87–185.
  • Feldman, Richard and Conee, Earl. (1985). "Evidentialism." Philosophical Studies, 48: 15–34.
    • Contains a discussion of "ought implies can" principles in epistemology.
  • Gigerenzer, Gerd. (2006). "Bounded and Rational." In Stanton, Robert J. (ed.) Contemporary Debates in Cognitive Science, Oxford, Blackwell.
  • Gigerenzer, Gerd. (2007). Gut Feelings: The Intelligence of the Unconscious, New York, Viking.
    • Summarizes and illustrates Gigerenzer's program of "fast and frugal" heuristics, and is intended for a wide audience.
  • Lavie, N. (1995). "Perceptual Load as a Necessary Condition for Selective Attention." Journal of Experimental Psychology: Human Perception and Performance, 21: 451–468.
  • Lavie, N. (2005). "Distracted and Confused? Selective Attention Under Load." Trends in Cognitive Science, 5: 75–82.
  • Macrae, C.N. and MacLeod, M.D. (1999). "On Recollections Lost: When Practice Makes Imperfect." Journal of Personality and Social Psychology, 77: 463–473.
  • Miller, George A. (1956). "The Magical Number Seven, Plus or Minus Two: Some Limits On Our Capacity For Processing Information." The Psychological Review, 63 (2): 81–97.
    • Classic paper on memory limitations and an early example of the fields of cognitive science and cognitive psychology.
  • Piattelli-Palmarini, Massimo. (1994). Inevitable Illusions: How Mistakes of Reason Rule Our Minds, New York, John Wiley and Sons.
    • Applies elements of the "heurisitics and biases" program and argues that these results help reveal common errors in judgment.
  • Pollock, John. (2006). Thinking About Acting: Logical Foundations for Rational Decision Making, Cambridge, Oxford University Press.
    • Applying work from epistemology and cognitive science, Pollock proposes a theory of rational decision making for resource bounded agents.
  • Sears, Christopher R. and Pylyshyn, Zenon. (2000). "Multiple Object Tracking and Attentional Processing." Canadian Journal of Experimental Psychology, 54 (1): 1–14.
  • Shaffer, Dennis M., Krauchunas, Scott M., Eddy, Marianna, and McBeath, Michael K. (2004). "How Dogs Navigate to Catch Frisbees." Psychological Science, 15 (7): 437–441.
  • Simon, Herbert A. (1955). "A Behavioral Model of Rational Choice." The Quarterly Journal of Economics, 69 (1): 99–118.
  • Simon, Herbert A. (1956). "Rational Choice and the Structure of the Environment." Psychological Review, 63 (2): 129–138.
    • An early description of the satisficing procedure.
  • Stroop, J.R. (1935). "Studies of Interference In Serial Verbal Reactions." Journal of Experimental Psychology, 18: 643–662.
  • Thagard, Paul. (1982). "From the Descriptive to the Normative in Psychology and Logic." Philosophy of Science, 49 (1): 24–42.
  • Tversky, Amos and Kahneman, Daniel. (1983). "Extensional Versus Intuitive Reasoning: The Conjunction Fallacy in Probability Judgment." Psychological Review, 90 (4): 293–315.
    • Contains the well-known "Linda" example of the conjunction fallacy in probabilistic judgment.
  • Xu, Yaoda and Chun, Marvin. (2009). "Selecting and Perceiving Multiple Visual Objects." Trends in Cognitive Science, 13 (4): 167–174.

b. Further Reading

  • Bishop, Michael A. and Trout, J.D. (2005). Epistemology and the Psychology of Human Judgment, Oxford, Oxford University Press.
    • Discusses and offers critiques of various epistemic norms, often citing important work in cognitive science and cognitive psychology.
  • Christensen, David. (2005). Putting Logic in its Place, Cambridge, Oxford University Press.
    • Provides discussion about the use of idealized models. Argues that the unattainability of idealized normative standards in epistemology does not         undermine their normative force.
  • Gigerenzer, Gerd and Selten, Reinhard (eds.). (2001). Bounded Rationality: The Adaptive Toolbox, Cambridge, MIT Press.
    • An influential collection of papers on bounded rationality.
  • Goldstein, E. Bruce. (2011). Cognitive Psychology: Connecting Mind, Research, and Everyday Experience. Belmont, Wadsworth.
    • Introductory text in cognitive psychology. Some of the examples of cognitive limitations from section 1 were drawn from this text.
  • Kahneman, Daniel. (2011). Thinking Fast and Slow. New York, Farrar, Straus, and Giroux.
    • Provides an overview of the "heuristics and biases" program and the two-system model of judgment.
  • Morton, Adam. (2012). Bounded Thinking: Intellectual Virtues for Limited Agents, Oxford, Oxford University Press.
    • A virtue-theoretic account of bounded rationality and bounded thinking. Addresses how agents should manage limitations.
  • Rubinstein, Ariel. (1998). Modeling Bounded Rationality, Cambridge, MIT Press.
    • Provides examples of formal models for resource bounded agents.
  • Rysiew, Patrick. (2008). "Rationality Disputes — Psychology and Epistemology." Philosophy Compass, 3 (6): 1153–1176.
    • Good discussion and overview of the "rationality wars" debate in cognitive science and epistemology.
  • Simon, Herbert A. (1982). Models of Bounded Rationality, Vol. 2, Behavioral Economics and Business Organization. Cambridge, MIT Press.
    • Collection of some of Simon's influential papers on bounded rationality and procedural rationality.
  • Weirich, Paul. (2004). Realistic Decision Theory: Rules for Nonideal Agents in Nonideal Circumstances, Oxford, Oxford University Press.
    • Argues for principles of decision making that apply to realistic, non-ideal agents.


Author Information

Jacob Caton
Arkansas State University
U. S. A.

Locke: Ethics

LockeThe major writings of John Locke (1632–1704) are among the most important texts for understanding some of the central currents in epistemology, metaphysics, politics, religion, and pedagogy in the late 17th and early 18th century in Western Europe. His magnum opus, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1689) is the undeniable starting point for the study of empiricism in the early modern period. Locke’s best-known political text, Two Treatises of Government (1693) criticizes the political system according to which kings rule by divine right (First Treatise) and lays the foundation for modern liberalism (Second Treatise). His Letter Concerning Toleration (1689) argues that much civil unrest is borne of the state trying to prevent the practice of different religions. In this text, Locke suggests that the proper domain of government does not include deciding which religious path the people ought to take for salvation—in short, it is an argument for the separation of church and state. Some Thoughts Concerning Education (1693) is a very influential text in early modern Europe that outlines the best way to rear children. It suggests that the virtue of a person is directly related to the habits of body and the habits of mind instilled in them by their educators.

Although these texts enjoy a status of “must-reads,” Locke’s views on ethics or moral philosophy have nowhere near the same high status. The reason for this is, in large part, that Locke never wrote a text devoted to the topic. This omission is surprising given that several of his friends entreated him to set down his thoughts about ethics. They saw that the scattered remarks that Locke makes about morality here and there throughout his works were, at times, quite provocative and in need of further development and defense. But, for reasons unknown to us, Locke never indulged his friends with a more systematic moral philosophy. It is thus up to his readers to stitch together his fragmented remarks about happiness, moral laws, freedom, and virtue in order to see what kind of moral philosophy is woven through the texts and to determine whether it is a coherent position.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Good
    1. Pleasure and Pain
    2. Happiness
  3. The Law of Nature
    1. Existence
    2. Content
    3. Authority
    4. Reconciling the Law with Happiness
  4. Power, Freedom, and Suspending Desire
    1. Passive and Active Powers
    2. The Will
    3. Freedom
    4. Judgment
  5. Living the Moral Life
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources: Books
    3. Secondary Sources: Articles

1. Introduction

While Locke did not write a treatise devoted to a discussion of ethics, there are strands of discussion of morality that weave through many, if not most, of his works. One such strand is evident near the end of his An Essay Concerning Human Understanding (hereafter: Essay) where he states that one of the most important aspects of improving our knowledge is to recognize the kinds of things that we can truly know. With this recognition, he says, we are able to finely-tune the focus of our enquiries for optimal results. And, he concludes, given the natural capacities of human beings, “Morality is the proper Science, and Business of Mankind in general” because human beings are both “concerned” and “fitted to search out their Summum Bonum [highest good]” (Essay, Book IV, chapter xii, section 11; hereafter: Essay, IV.xii.11). This claim indicates that Locke takes the investigation of morality to be of utmost importance and gives us good reason to think that Locke’s analysis of the workings of human understanding in general is intimately connected to discovering how the science proper to humankind is to be practiced. The content of the knowledge of ethics includes information about what we, as rational and voluntary agents, ought to do in order to obtain an end, in particular, the end of happiness. It is the science, Locke says, of using the powers that we have as human beings in order to act in such a way that we obtain things that are good and useful for us. As he says: ethics is “the seeking out those Rules, and Measures of humane Actions, which lead to Happiness, and the Means to practice them” (Essay, IV.xxi.3). So, there are several elements in the landscape of Locke’s ethics: happiness or the highest good as the end of human action; the rules that govern human action; the powers that command human action; and the ways and means by which the rules are practiced. While Locke lays out this conception of ethics in the Essay, not all aspects of his definition are explored in detail in that text. So, in order to get the full picture of how he understands each element of his description of ethics, we must often look to several different texts where they receive a fuller treatment. This means that Locke himself does not explain how these elements fit together leaving his overarching theory somewhat of a puzzle for future commentators to contemplate. But, by mining different texts in this way, we can piece together the details of an ethical theory that, while not always obviously coherent, presents a depth and complexity that, at minimum, confirms that this is a puzzle worth trying to solve.

2. The Good

a. Pleasure and Pain

The thread of moral discussion that weaves most consistently throughout the Essay is the subject of happiness. True happiness, on Locke’s account, is associated with the good, which in turn is associated with pleasure. Pleasure, in its turn, is taken by Locke to be the sole motive for human action. This means that the moral theory that is most directly endorsed in the Essay is hedonism.

On Locke’s view, ideas come to us by two means: sensation and reflection. This view is the cornerstone of his empiricism. According to this theory, there is no such thing as innate ideas or ideas that are inborn in the human mind. All ideas come to us by experience. Locke describes sensation as the “great source” of all our ideas and as wholly dependent on the contact between our sensory organs and the external world. The other source of ideas, reflection or “internal sense,” is dependent on the mind’s reflecting on its own operations, in particular the “satisfaction or uneasiness arising from any thought” (Essay, II.i.4). What’s more, Locke states that pleasure and pain are joined to almost all of our ideas both of sensation and of reflection (Essay, II.vii.2). This means that our mental content is organized, at least in one way, by ideas that are associated with pleasure and ideas that are associated with pain. That our ideas are associated with pains and pleasures seems compatible with our phenomenal experience: the contact between the sense organ of touch and a hot stove will result in an idea of the hot stove annexed by the idea of pain, or the act of remembering a romantic first kiss brings with it the idea of pleasure. And, Locke adds, it makes sense to join our ideas to the ideas of pleasure and pain because if our ideas were not joined with either pleasure of pain, we would have no reason to prefer the doing of one action over another, or the consideration of one idea over another. If this were our situation, we would have no reason to act—either physically or mentally (Essay, II.viii.3). That pleasure and pain are given this motivational role in action entails that Locke endorses hedonism: the pursuit of pleasure and the avoidance of pain are the sole motives for action.

Locke notes that among all the ideas that we receive by sensation and reflection, pleasure and pain are very important. And, he notes that the things that we describe as evil are no more than the things that are annexed to the idea of pain, and the things that we describe as good are no more than the things that are annexed to the idea of pleasure. In other words, the presence of good or evil is nothing other than the way a particular idea relates to us—either pleasurably or painfully. This means that on Locke’s view, good is just the category of things that tend to cause or increase pleasure or decrease pain in us, and evil is just the category of things that tend to cause or increase pain or decrease pleasure in us (Essay, II.xx.2). Now, we might think that, morally speaking, this way of defining good and evil gets Locke into trouble. Consider the following scenario. Smith enjoys breaking her promises. In other words, failing to honor her word brings her pleasure. According to the view just described, it seems that breaking promises, at least for Smith, is a good. For, if good and evil are defined as nothing more than pleasure and pain, it seems that if something gives Smith pleasure, it is impossible to deny that it is a good. This would be an unwelcome effect of Locke’s view, for it would indicate that his system leads directly to a kind of moral relativism. If promise breaking is pleasurable for Smith and promise keeping is pleasurable for her friend Jones and pleasure is the sign of the good, then it seems that the good is relative and there is no sense in which we can say that Jones is right about what is good and Smith is wrong. Locke blocks this kind of consequence for his view by introducing a distinction between “happiness” and “true happiness.” This indicates that while all things that bring us pleasure are linked to happiness, there is also a category of pleasure-bringing things that are linked to true happiness. It is the pursuit of the members of this special category of pleasurable things that is, for Locke, emblematic of the correct use of our intellectual powers.

b. Happiness

Locke is very clear—we all constantly desire happiness. All of our actions, on his view, are oriented towards securing happiness. Uneasiness, Locke’s technical term for being in a state of pain and desirous of some absent good, is the motive that moves us to act in the way that is expected to relieve the pain of desire and secure the state of happiness (Essay, II.xxi.36). But, while Locke equates pleasure with good, he is careful to distinguish the happiness that is acquired as a result of the satisfaction of any particular desire and the true happiness that is the result of the satisfaction of a particular kind of desire. Drawing this distinction allows Locke to hold that the pursuit of a certain sets of pleasures or goods is more worthy than the pursuit of others.

The pursuit of true happiness, according to Locke, is equated with “the highest perfection of intellectual nature” (Essay, II.xxi.51). And, indeed, Locke takes our pursuit of this true happiness to be the thing to which the vast majority of our efforts should be oriented. To do this, he says that we need to try to match our desires to “the true instrinsick good” that is really within things. Notice here that Locke is implying that there is distinction to be drawn between the “true intrinsic good” of a thing and, it seems, the good that we unreflectively take to be within a certain thing. The idea here is that attentively considering a particular thing will allow us to see its true value as opposed to the superficial value we assign to a thing based on our immediate reaction to it. We can think, for example, of a bitter tasting medicine. A face-value assessment of the medicine will lead us to evaluate that the thing is to be avoided. However, more information and contemplation of it will lead us to see that the true worth of the medicine is, in fact, high and so it should be evaluated as a good to be pursued. And, Locke states, if we contemplate a thing long enough, and see clearly the measure of its true worth; we can change our desire and uneasiness for it in proportion to that worth (Essay, II.xxi.53). But how are we to understand Locke’s suggestion that there is a true, intrinsic good in things? So far, all he has said about the good is that it is tracked by pleasure. We begin to get an answer to this question when Locke acknowledges the obvious fact that different people derive pleasure and pain from different things. While he reiterates that happiness is no more than the possession of those things that give the most pleasure and the absence of those things that cause the most pain, and that the objects in these two categories can vary widely among people, he adds the following provocative statement:

 If therefore Men in this Life only have hope; if in this Life they can only enjoy, 'tis not strange, nor unreasonable, that they should seek their Happiness by avoiding all things, that disease them here, and by pursuing all that delight them; wherein it will be no wonder to find variety and difference. For if there be no Prospect beyond the Grave, the inference is certainly right, Let us eat and drink, let us enjoy what we delight in, for tomorrow we shall die [Isa, 22:13; I Cor. 15:32]. (Essay, II.xxi.55)

Here, Locke suggests that pursuing and avoiding the particular things that give us pleasure or pain would be a perfectly acceptable way to live were there “no prospect beyond the grave.” It seems that what Locke means is that if there were no judgment day, which is to say that if our actions were not ultimately judged by God, there would be no reason to do otherwise than to blindly follow our pleasures and flee our pains. Now, given this suggestion, the question, then, is how to distinguish between the things that are pleasurable but that will not help our case on judgment day, and those that will. Locke provides a clue for how to do such a thing when he says that the will is typically determined by those things that are judged to be good by the understanding. However, in many cases we use “wrong measures of good and evil” and end by judging unworthy things to be good. He who makes such a mistake errs because “[t]he eternal Law and Nature of things must not be alter’d to comply with his ill order’d choice” (Essay, II.xxi.56). In other words, there is an ordered way to choose which things to pursue—the things that are in accordance with the eternal law and nature of things—and an ill-ordered way, in accordance with our own palates. This indicates that Locke takes there to be a fixed law that determines which things are worthy of our pursuit, and which are not. This means that Locke takes there to be an important distinction between the good, understood as all objects that are connected to pleasure and the moral good, understood as objects connected to pleasure which are also in conformity with a law. Though the distinctions between good and moral good, and between evil and moral evil are not discussed in any great detail by Locke, he does states that moral good and evil is nothing other than the “Conformity or Disagreement of our voluntary Actions to some Law.” Locke states punishments and rewards are bestowed on us for our following or failure to follow this law by “the Will and Power of the Law-maker” (Essay, II.xxviii.5). So, Locke affirms that moral good and evil are closely tied to the observance or violation of some law, and that the lawmaker has the power to reward or punish those who adhere to or stray from the law.

3. The Law of Nature

a. Existence

In the Essay, the concepts of laws and lawmakers do not receive much treatment beyond Locke’s affirmation that God has decreed laws and that there are rewards and punishments associated with the respect or violation of these laws (Essay, I.iii.6; I.iii.12; II.xxi.70; II.xxviii.6). The two most important questions concerning the role of laws in a system of ethics remain unanswered in the Essay: (1) how do we determine the content of the law? This is the epistemological question. And (2) what kind of authority does the law have to obligate? This is the moral question. Locke spends much time considering these questions in a series of nine essays written some thirty years before the Essay, which are known under the collected title Essays on the Law of Nature (hereafter: Law).

The first essay in the series treats the question of whether there is a “rule of morals, or law of nature given to us.” The answer is unequivocally “yes” (Law, Essay I, page 109; hereafter: Law, I: 109). The reason for this positive answer, in short, is because God exists. Locke appeals to a kind of teleological argument to support the claim of God’s existence, saying that given the organization of the universe, including the organized way in which animal and vegetable bodies propagate, there must be a governing principle that is responsible for the patterns we see on earth. And, if we extend this principle to the existence of human life, Locke claims that it is reasonable to believe that there is a pattern or a law that governs behavior. This law is to be understood as moral good or virtue and, Locke states, it is the decree of God’s will and is discernable by “the light of nature.” Because the law tells us what is and is not in conformity with “rational nature,” it has the status of commanding or prohibiting certain behaviors (Law, I: 111; see also Essay, IV.xix.16). Because all human beings possess, by nature, the faculty of reason, all human beings, at least in principle, can discover the natural law.

Locke offers five reasons for thinking that such a natural law exists. He begins by noting that it is evident that there is some disagreement among people about the content of the law. However, far from thinking that such disagreement casts doubt on the existence of the law, he takes the presence of disagreement about the law as evidence that such a true and objective law exists. Disagreements about the content of the law confirm that everyone is in agreement about the fundamental character of the law—that there are things that are by their nature good or evil—but just disagree about how to interpret the law (Law, I: 115). The existence of the law is further reinforced by the fact that we often pass judgment on our own actions, by way of our conscience, leading to feelings of guilt or pride. Because it is not possible, according to Locke, to pronounce a judgment without the existence of a law, the act of conscience demonstrates that such a natural law exists. Third, again appealing to a kind of teleological argument, Locke states that we see that laws govern all manner of natural operations and that it makes sense that human beings would also be governed by laws that are in accordance with their nature (Law, I: 117). Fourth, Locke states that without the natural law, society would not be able to run the way that it does. He suggests that the force of civil law is grounded on the natural law. In other words, without the natural law, positive law would have no moral authority. Elsewhere, Locke underlines this point by saying that given that the law of nature is the eternal rule for all men, the rules made by legislators must conform to this law (The Two Treatises of Government, Treatise II, section 135, hereafter: Government, II.35). Finally, on Locke’s view, there would be no virtue or vice, no reward or punishment, no guilt, if there were no natural law (Law, I: 119). Without the natural law, there would be no bounds on human action. This means that we would be motivated only to do what seems pleasurable and there would be no sense in which anyone could be considered virtuous or vicious. The existence of the natural law, then, allows us to be sensitive to the fact that there are certain pleasures that are more in line with what is objectively right. Indeed, Locke also gestures towards, but does not elaborate on, this kind of thought in the Essay. He suggests that the studious man, who takes all his pleasures from reading and learning will eventually be unable to ignore his desires for food and drink. Likewise, the “Epicure,” whose only interest is in the sensory pleasures of food and drink, will eventually turn his attention to study when shame or the desire to “recommend himself to his Mistress” will raise his uneasiness for knowledge (Essay, II.xxi.43).

So, Locke has given us five reasons to accept the existence of the law of nature that grounds virtuous and vicious behavior. We turn now to how he thinks we come to know the content of the law.

b. Content

Locke suggests that there are two ways to determine the content of the law of nature: by the light of nature and by sense experience.

Locke is careful to note that by “light of nature” he does not mean something like an “inward light” that is “implanted in man” and like a compass constantly leads human beings towards virtue. Rather, this light is to be understood as a kind of metaphor that indicates that truth can be attained by each of us individually by nothing more than the exercise of reason and the intellectual faculties (Law, II: 123). Locke uses a comparison to precious metal mining to make this point clear. He acknowledges that some might say that his explanation of the discovery of the content of the law by the light of nature entails that everyone should always be in possession of the knowledge of this content. But, he notes, this is to take the light of nature as something that is stamped on the hearts on human beings, which is a mistake (see Law, III, 137-145). While the depths of the earth might contain veins of gold and silver, Locke says, this does not mean that everyone living on the stretch of land above those veins is rich (Law, II: 135). Work must be done to dig out the precious metals in order to benefit from their value. Similarly, proper use must be made of the faculties we have in order to benefit from the certainty provided by the light of nature. Locke notes that we can come to know the law of nature, in a way, by tradition, which is to say by the testimony and instruction of other people. But it is a mistake to follow the law for any reason other than that we recognize its universal binding force. This can only be done by our own intellectual investigation (Law, II: 129).

But what, exactly, is the light of nature? Locke acknowledges that it is difficult to answer this question—it is not something stamped on the heart or mind, nor is it something that is exclusively learned by tradition or testimony. The only option left for describing it, then, is that it is something acquired or experienced by sense experience or by reason. And, indeed, Locke suggests that when these two faculties, reason and sensation, work together, nothing can remain obscure to the mind. Sensation provides the mind with ideas and reason guides the faculty of sensation and arranges “together the images of things derived from sense-perception, thence forming others [ideas] and composing new ones” (Law, IV: 147). Locke emphasizes that reason ought to be taken to mean “the discursive faculty of the mind, which advances from things known to thinks unknown,” using as its foundation the data provided by sense experience (Law, IV: 149).

When directly addressing the question of how the combination of reason and sense experience allow us to know the content of the law of nature, Locke states that two important truths must be acknowledged because they are “presupposed in the knowledge of any and every law” (Law, IV: 151). First, we must understand that there is a lawmaker who decreed the law, and that the lawmaker is rightly obeyed as a superior power (a discussion of this point is also found in Government, I.81). Second, we must understand that the lawmaker wishes those to whom the law is decreed to follow the law. Let us take each of these in turn.

Sense experience allows us to know that a lawmaker exists. To demonstrate this, Locke appeals, once again, to a kind of teleological argument: by our senses we come to know the objects external world and, importantly, the regularities with which they move and change. We also see that we human beings are part of the movements and changes of the external world. Reason, then, contemplates these regularities and orders of change and motion and naturally comes to inquire about their origin. The conclusion of such an inquiry, states Locke, is that a powerful and wise creator exists. This conclusion follows from two observations: (1) that beasts and inanimate things cannot be the cause of the existence of human beings because they are clearly less perfect than human beings, and something less perfect cannot bring more perfect things into existence, and 2) that we ourselves cannot be the cause of our own existence because if we possessed the power to create ourselves, we would also have the power to give ourselves eternal life. Because it is obviously the case that we do not have eternal life, Locke concludes that we cannot be the origin of our own existence. So, Locke says, there must be a powerful agent, God, who is the origin of our existence (Law, IV: 153). The senses provide the data from the external world, and reason contemplates the data and concludes that a creator of the observed objects and phenomena must exist. Once the existence of a creator is determined, Locke thinks that we can also see that the creator has “a just and inevitable command over us and at His pleasure can raise us up or throw us down, and make us by the same commanding power happy or miserable” (Law, IV: 155). This commanding power, on Locke’s view, indicates that we are necessarily subject to the decrees of God’s will. (A similar line of discussion is found in Locke’s The Reasonableness of Christianity, 144–46.)

As for the second truth, that the lawmaker, God, wishes us to follow the laws decreed, Locke states that once we see that there is a creator of all things and that an order obtains among them, we see that the creator is both powerful and wise. It follows from these evident attributes that God would not create something without a purpose. Moreover, we notice that our minds and bodies seem well equipped for action, which suggests, “God intends man to do something.” And, the “something” that we are made to do, according to Locke, is the same purpose shared by all created things—the glorification of God (Law, IV: 157). In the case of rational beings, Locke states that given our nature, our function is to use sense experience and reason in order to discover, contemplate, and praise God’s creation; to create a society with other people and to work to maintain and preserve both oneself and the community. And this, in fact, is the content of the law of nature—to preserve one’s own being and to work to maintain and preserve the beings of the other people in our community. This injunction to preserve oneself and to preserve one’s neighbors is also endorsed and stressed throughout Locke’s discussions of political power and freedom (see Government, I.86, 88, 120; II.6, 25, 128).

c. Authority

Once we have knowledge of the content of the law of nature, we must determine from where it derives its authority. In other words, we must ask why we are bound to follow the law once we are aware of its content. Locke begins this discussion by reiterating that the law of nature “is the care and preservation of oneself.” Given this law, he states that virtue should not be understood as a duty but rather the “convenience” of human beings. In this sense, the good is nothing more than what is useful. Further, he adds, the observance of this law is not so much an obligation but rather “a privilege and an advantage, to which we are led by expediency” (Law, VI: 181). This indicates that Locke thinks that actions that are in conformity with the law are useful and practical. In other words, it is in our best interest to follow the law. While this characterization of why we in fact follow the law is compelling, there is nevertheless still an inquiry to be made into why we ought to follow the law.

Locke begins his treatment of this question by stating that no one can oblige us to do anything unless the one who obliges has some superior right and power over us. The obligation that is generated between such a superior power and those who are subject to it results in two kinds of duties: (1) the duty to pay obedience to the command of the superior power. Because our faculties are suited to discover the existence of the divine lawmaker, Locke takes it to be impossible to avoid this discovery, barring some damage or impediment to our faculties. This duty is ultimately grounded in God’s will as the force by which we were created (Law, VI: 183). (2) The duty to suffer punishment as a result of the failure to honor the first duty—obedience. Now, it might seem odd that it would be necessary to postulate that punishment results from the failure to respect a law the content of which is only that we must take care of ourselves. In other words, how could anyone express so little interest in taking care of himself or herself that the fear of punishment is needed to motivate the actions necessary for such care? It is worth quoting Locke’s answer in full:

[A] liability to punishment, which arises from a failure to pay dutiful obedience, so that those who refuse to be led by reason and to own that in the matter of morals and right conduct they are subject to a superior authority may recognize that they are constrained by force and punishment to be submissive to that authority and feel the strength of Him whose will they refuse to follow. And so the force of this obligation seems to be grounded in the authority of a lawmaker, so that power compels those who cannot be moved by warnings. (Law, VI: 183)

So, even though the existence, content, and authority of the law of nature are known in virtue of the faculties possessed by all rational creatures—sense experience and reason—Locke recognizes that there are people who “refuse to be led by reason.” Because these people do not see the binding force of the law by their faculties alone, they need some other impetus to motivate their behavior. But, Locke thinks very ill of those who are in need of this other impetus. He says the these features of the law of nature can be discovered by anyone who is diligent about directing their mind to them, and can be concealed from no one “unless he loves blindness and darkness and casts off nature in order that he may avoid his duty” (Law, VI: 189, see also Government, II.6).

d. Reconciling the Law with Happiness

The main lines of Locke’s natural law theory are as follows: there is a moral law that is (1) discoverable by the combined work of reason and sense experience, and (2) binding on human beings in virtue of being decreed by God. Now, in §1 above, we saw that Locke thinks that all human beings are naturally oriented to the pursuit of happiness. This is because we are motivated to pursue things if they promise pleasure and to avoid things if they promise pain. It has seemed to many commentators that these two discussions of moral principles are in tension with each other. On the view described in Law, Locke straightforwardly appeals to reason and our ability to understand the nature of God’s attributes to ground our obligation to follow the law of nature. In other words, what is lawful ought to be followed because God wills it and what is unlawful ought to be rejected because it is not willed by God. Because we can straightforwardly see that God is the law-giver and that we are by nature subordinate to Him, we ought to follow the law. By contrast, in the discussion of happiness and pleasure in the Essay, Locke explains that good and evil reduce to what is pleasurable and what is painful. While he does also indicate that the special categories of good and evil—moral good and moral evil—are no more than the conformity or disagreement between our actions and a law, he immediately adds that such conformity or disagreement is followed by rewards or punishments that flow from the lawmaker’s will. From this discussion, then, it is difficult to see whether Locke holds that it is the reward and punishment that binds human beings to act in accordance with the law, or if it is the fact that the law is willed by God.

One way to approach this problem is to suggest that Locke changed his mind. Because of the thirty-year gap between Law and the Essay, we might be tempted to think that the more rationalist picture, where the law and its authority are based on reason, was the young Locke’s view when he wrote Law. This view, the story would go, was replaced by Locke’s more considered and mature view, hedonism. But this approach must be resisted because both theories are present in early and late works. The role of pleasure and pain with respect to morality is present not only in the Essay, but is invoked in Law (passage quoted at the end of §2c), and many other various minor essays written in the years between Law and Essay (for example, ‘Morality’ (c.1677–78) in Political Essays, 267–69). Likewise, the role of the authority of God's will is retained after Law, again evident in various minor essays (for example, ‘Virtue B’ (1681) in Political Essays, 287-88), Government II.6), Locke’s correspondence (for example, to James Tyrrell, 4 August 1690, Correspondence, Vol.4, letter n.1309) and even in the Essay itself (II.xxviii.8). An answer to how we might reconcile these two positions is suggested when we consider the texts where appeals to both theories are found side-by-side in certain passages.

In his essay Of Ethick in General (c. 1686–88) Locke affirms the hedonist view that happiness and misery consist only in pleasure and pain, and that we all naturally seek happiness. But in the very next paragraph, he states that there is an important difference between moral and natural good and evil—the pleasure and pain that are consequences of virtuous and vicious behavior are grounded in the divine will. Locke notes that drinking to excess leads to pain in the form of headache or nausea. This is an example of a natural evil. By contrast, transgressing a law would not have any painful consequences if the law were not decreed by a superior lawmaker. He adds that it is impossible to motivate the actions of rational agents without the promise of pain or pleasure (Of Ethick in General, §8). From these considerations, Locke suggests that the proper foundation of morality, a foundation that will entail an obligation to moral principles, needs two things. First, we need the proof of a law, which presupposes the existence of a lawmaker who is superior to those to whom the law is decreed. The lawmaker has the right to ordain the law and the power to reward and punish. Second, it must be shown that the content of the law is discoverable to humankind (Of Ethick in General, §12). In this text it seems that Locke suggests that both the force and authority of the divine decree and the promise of reward and punishment are necessary for the proper foundation of an obligating moral law.

A similar line of argument is found in the Essay. There, Locke asserts that in order to judge moral success or failure, we need a rule by which to measure and judge action. Further, each rule of this sort has an “enforcement of Good and Evil.” This is because, according to Locke, “where-ever we suppose a Law, suppose also some Reward or Punishment annexed to that Law” (Essay, II.xxviii.6). Locke states that some promise of pleasure or pain is necessary in order to determine the will to pursue or avoid certain actions. Indeed, he puts the point even more strongly, saying that it would be in vain for the intelligent being who decrees the rule of law to so decree without entailing reward or punishment for the obedient or the unfaithful (see also Government, II.7). It seems, then, that reason discovers the fact that a divine law exists and that it derives from the divine will and, as such, is binding. We might think, as Stephen Darwall suggests in The British Moralists and the Internal Ought, that if reason is that which discovers our obligation to the law, the role for reward and punishment is to motivate our obedience to the law. While this succeeds in making room for both the rationalist and hedonist strains in Locke’s view, some other texts seem to indicate that by reason alone we ought to be motivated to follow moral laws.

One striking instance of this kind of suggestion is found in the third book of the Essay where Locke boldly states that “Morality is capable of Demonstration” in the same way as mathematics (Essay, III.xi.16). He explains that once we understand the existence and nature of God as a supreme being who is infinite in power, goodness, and wisdom and on whom we depend, and our own nature “as understanding, rational Beings,” we should be able to see that these two things together provide the foundation of both our duty and the appropriate rules of action. On Locke’s view, with focused attention the measures of right and wrong will become as clear to us as the propositions of mathematics (Essay, IV.iii.18). He gives two examples of such certain moral principles to make the point: (1) “Where there is no Property, there is no Injustice” and (2) “No Government allows absolute Liberty.” He explains that property implies a right to something and injustice is the violation of a right to something. So, if we clearly see the intensional definition of each term, we see that (1) is necessarily true. Similarly, government indicates the establishment of a society based on certain rules, and absolute liberty is the freedom from any and all rules. Again, if we understand the definitions of the two terms in the proposition, it becomes obvious that (2) is necessarily true. And, Locke states, following this logic, 1 and 2 are as certain as the proposition that “a Triangle has three Angles equal to two right ones” (Essay, IV.iii.18). If moral principles have the same status as mathematical principles, it is difficult to see why we would need further inducement to use these principles to guide our behavior. While there is no clear answer to this question, Locke does provide a way to understand the role of reward and punishment in our obligation to moral principles despite the fact that it seems that they ought to obligate by reason alone.

Early in the Essay, over the course of giving arguments against the existence of innate ideas, Locke addresses the possibility of innate moral principles. He begins by saying that for any proposed moral rule human beings can, with good reason, demand justification. This precludes the possibility of innate moral principles because, if they were innate, they would be self-evident and thus would not be candidates for justification. Next, Locke notes that despite the fact that there are no innate moral principles, there are certain principles that are undeniable, for example, that “men should keep their Compacts.” However, when asked why people follow this rule, different answers are given. A “Hobbist” will say that it is because the public requires it, and the “Leviathan” will punish those who disobey the law. A “Heathen” philosopher will say that it is because following such a law is a virtue, which is the highest perfection for human beings. But a Christian philosopher, the category to which Locke belongs, will say that it is because “God, who has the Power of eternal Life and Death, requires it of us” (Essay, I.iii.5). Locke builds on this statement in the following section when he notes that while the existence of God and the truth of our obedience to Him is made manifest by the light of reason, it is possible that there are people who accept the truth of moral principles, and follow them, without knowing or accepting the “true ground of Morality; which can only be the Will and Law of God” (Essay, I.iii.6). Here Locke is suggesting that we can accept a true moral law as binding and follow it as such, but for the wrong reasons. This means that while the Hobbist, the Heathen, and the Christian might all take the same law of keeping one’s compacts to be obligating, only the Christian does it for the right reason—that God’s will requires our obedience to that law. Indeed, Locke states that if we receive truths by revelation they too must be subject to reason, for to follow truths based on revelation alone is insufficient (see Essay, IV.xviii).

Now, to determine the role of pain and pleasure in this story, we turn to Locke’s discussion of the role of pain and pleasure in general. He says that God has joined pains and pleasures to our interaction with many things in our environment in order to alert us to things that are harmful or helpful to the preservation of our bodies (Essay, II.vii.4). But, beyond this, Locke notes that there is another reason that God has joined pleasure and pain to almost all our thoughts and sensations: so that we experience imperfections and dissatisfactions. He states that the kinds of pleasures that we experience in connection to finite things are ephemeral and not representative of complete happiness. This dissatisfaction coupled with the natural drive to obtain happiness opens the possibility of our being led to seek our pleasure in God, where we anticipate a more stable and, perhaps, permanent happiness. Appreciating this reason why pleasure and pain are annexed to most of our ideas will, according to Locke, lead the way to the ultimate aim of the enquiry in human understanding—the knowledge and veneration of God (Essay, II.vii.5–6). So, Locke seems to be suggesting here that pain and pleasure prompt us to find out about God, in whom complete and eternal happiness is possible. This search, in turn, leads us to knowledge of God, which will include the knowledge that He ought to be obeyed in virtue of His decrees alone. Pleasure and pain, reward and punishment, on this interpretation, are the means by which we are led to know God’s nature, which, once known, motivates obedience to His laws. This mechanism supports Locke’s claim that real happiness is to be found in the perfection of our intellectual nature—in embarking on the search for knowledge of God, we embark on the intellectual journey that will lead to the kind of knowledge that brings permanent pleasure. This at least suggests that the knowledge of God has the happy double-effect of leading to both more stable happiness and the understanding that God is to be obeyed in virtue of His divine will alone.

But given that all human beings experience pain and pleasure, Locke needs to explain how it is that certain people are virtuous, having followed the experience of dissatisfaction to arrive at the knowledge of God, and other people are vicious, who seek pleasure and avoid pain for no reason other than their own hedonic sensations.

4. Power, Freedom, and Suspending Desire

a. Passive and Active Powers

In any discussion of ethics, it is important not only to determine what, exactly, counts as virtuous and vicious behavior, but also the extent to which we are in control of our actions. This is important because we want to be able to adequately connect behavior to agents in order to attribute praise or blame, reward or punishment to an agent, we need to be able to see the way in which she is the causal source of her own actions. Locke addresses this issue in one of the longest chapters of the Essay—“Of Power.” In this chapter, Locke describes how he understands the nature of power, the human will, freedom and its connection to happiness, and, finally, the reasons why many (or even most) people do not exercise their freedom in the right kind of way and are unhappy as a result. It is worth noting here that this chapter of the Essay underwent major revisions throughout the five editions of the Essay and in particular between the first and second edition. The present discussion is based on the fourth edition of the Essay (but see the “References and Further Reading” below for articles that discuss the relevance of the changes throughout all five editions).

Locke states that we come to have the idea of “power” by observing the fact that things change over time. Finite objects are changed as a result of interactions with other finite objects (for example fire melts gold) and we notice that our own ideas change either as a result of external stimulus (for example the noise of a jackhammer interrupts the contemplation of a logic problem) or as a result of our own desires (for example hunger interrupts the contemplation of a logic problem). The idea of power always includes some kind of relation to action or change. The passive side of power entails the ability to be changed and the active side of power entails the ability to make change. Our observation of almost all sensible things furnishes us with the idea of passive power. This is because sensible things appear to be in almost constant flux—they are changed by their interaction with other sensible things, with heat, cold, rain, and time. And, Locke adds, such observations give us no fewer instances of the idea of active power, for “whatever Change is observed, the Mind must collect a Power somewhere, able to make that Change” (Essay, II.xxi.4). However, when it comes to active powers, Locke states that the clearest and most distinct idea of active power comes to us from the observation of the operations of our own minds. He elaborates by stating that there are two kinds of activities with which we are familiar: thinking and motion. When we consider body in general, Locke states that it is obvious that we receive no idea of thinking, which only comes from a contemplation of the operations of our own minds. But neither does body provide the idea of the beginning of motion, only of the continuation or transfer of motion. The idea of the beginning of motion, which is the idea associated with the active power of motion, only comes to us when we reflect “on what passes in our selves, where we find by Experience, that barely by willing it, barely by a thought of the Mind, we can move the parts of our Bodies, which were before at rest” (Essay, II.xxi.4). So, it seems, the operation of our minds, in particular the connection between one kind of thought, willing, and a change in either the content of our minds or the orientation of our bodies, provides us with the idea of an active power.

b. The Will

The power to stop, start, or continue an action of the mind or of the body is what Locke calls the will. When the power of the will is exercised, a volition (or willing) occurs. Any action (or forbearance of action) that follows volition is considered voluntary. The power of the will is coupled with the power of the understanding. This latter power is defined as the power of perceiving ideas and their agreement or disagreement with one another. The understanding, then, provides ideas to the mind and the will, depending on the content of these ideas, prefers certain courses of action to others. Locke explains that the will directs action according to its preference—and here we must understand “preference” in the most general sense of inclination, partiality, or taste. In short, the will is attracted to actions that promise the procurement of pleasing things and/or the distancing from displeasing things. The technical term that Locke uses to describe that which determines the will is uneasiness. He elaborates, stating that the reason why any action is continued is “the present satisfaction in it” and the reason why any action is taken to move to a new state is dissatisfaction (Essay, II.xxi.29). Indeed, Locke affirms that uneasiness, at bottom, is really no more than desire, where the mind is disturbed by a “want of some absent good” (Essay, II.xxi.31). So, any pain or discomfort of the mind or body is a motive for the will to command a change of state so as to move from unease to ease. Locke notes that it is a common fact of life that we often experience multiple uneasinesses at one time, all pressing on us and demanding relief. But, he says, when we ask the question of what determines the will at any one moment, the answer is the most pressing uneasiness (Essay, II.xxi.31). Imagine a situation where you are simultaneously experiencing discomfort as a result of hunger and the anxiety of being under-prepared for tomorrow’s philosophy exam. On Locke’s view the most intense or the most pressing of these uneasinesses will determine your will to command the action that will relieve it. This means that no matter how much you want to stay at the library to study, if hunger comes to be the more pressing than the desire to pass the exam, hunger will determine the will to act, commanding the action that will result in the procurement of food.

While Locke states that the most pressing uneasiness determines the will, he adds that it does so “for the most part, but not always.” This is because he takes the mind to have the power to “suspend the execution and satisfaction of any of its desires” (Essay, II.xxi.47). While a desire is suspended, Locke says, our mind, being temporarily freed from the discomfort of the want for the thing desired, has the opportunity to consider the relative worth of that thing. The idea here is that with appropriate deliberation about the value of the desired thing we will come to see which things are really worth pursuing and which are better left alone. And, Locke states, the conclusion at which we arrive after this intellectual endeavor of consideration and examination will indicate what, exactly, we take to be part of our happiness. And, in turn, by a mechanism that Locke does not describe in any detail, our uneasiness and desire for that thing will change to reflect whether we concluded that the thing does, indeed, play a role in our happiness or not (Essay, II.xxi.56). The problem is that there is no clear explanation for how, exactly, the power to suspend works. Despite this, Locke nowhere indicates that suspension is an action of the mind that is determined by anything other than volition of the will. We know that Locke takes all acts of the will to be determined by uneasiness. So, suspending our desires must be the result of uneasiness for something. Investigating how Locke understands human freedom and judgment will allow us to see what, exactly, we are uneasy for when we are determined to suspend our desires.

c. Freedom

When the nature of the human will is under discussion, we often want to know the extent of this faculty’s freedom. The reason why this question is important is because we want to see how autonomously the will can act. Typically, the question takes the form of: is the will free? Locke unequivocally denies that the will is free, implying, in fact, that it is a category mistake to ask the question at all. This is because, on his view, both the will and freedom are powers of agents, and it is a mistake to think that one power (the will) can have as a property a second power (freedom) (Essay, II.xxi.20). Instead, Locke thinks that the right question to pose is whether the agent is free. He defines freedom in the following way:

[T]he Idea of Liberty, is the Idea of a Power in any Agent to do or forbear any particular Action, according to the determination or thought of the mind, whereby either of them is preferr’d to the other; where either of them is not in the Power of the Agent to be produced by him according to his Volition here he is not a Liberty, that Agent is under Necessity. (Essay, II.xxi.8)

So, Locke considers that an agent is free in acting when her action is connected to her volition in the right kind of way. That is, when her action (or forbearance of action) follows from her volition, she is free. And, her volition is determined by the “thought of the mind” that indicates which action is preferred.

Notice here that Locke takes an agent to be free in acting when she acts according to her preference—this means that her actions are determined by her preference. This plainly shows that Locke does not endorse a kind of freedom of indifference, according to which the will can choose to command an action other than the thing most preferred at a given moment. This is the kind of freedom most often associated with indeterminism. Freedom, then, for Locke, is no more than the ability to execute the action that is taken to result in the most pleasure at a given moment. The problem with this way of defining freedom is that it seems unable to account for the kinds of actions we typically take to be emblematic of virtuous or vicious behavior. This is because we tend to think that the power of freedom is a power that allows us to avoid vicious actions, perhaps especially those that are pleasurable, in order to pursue a righteous path instead. For instance, on the traditional Christian picture, when we wonder about why God would allow Adam to sin, the response given is that Adam was created as a free being. While God could have created beings that, like automata, unfailingly followed the good and the true, He saw that it was all things considered better to create beings that were free to choose their own actions. This decision was made despite the fact that God foresaw the sinful use to which this freedom would be put. This traditional view explains Adam’s sin in the following way: Adam knew that it was God’s commandment that he was not to eat of the tree of knowledge. Adam also knew that following God’s commandment was the right thing to do. So, in the moment where he was tempted to eat the fruit of the tree of knowledge, he knew it was the wrong thing to do, but did it anyway. This is because, the story goes, and in that moment he was free to decide whether to follow the commandment or to give in to temptation. Of his own free choice, Adam decided to follow temptation. This means that in the moment of original sin, both following God’s commandment and eating the fruit were live options for Adam, and he chose the fruit of his own agency.

Now, on Locke’s system, a different explanation obtains. Given his definition of freedom, it is difficult, at least prima facie, to see how Adam could be blamed for choosing the fruit over the commandment. For, according to Locke, an agent acts freely when her actions are determined by her volitions. So, if Adam’s greatest uneasiness was for the fruit, and the act of eating the fruit was the result of his will commanding such action based on his preference, then he acted freely. But, on this understanding of freedom, it is difficult to see how, exactly, Adam can be morally blamed for eating the fruit. The question now becomes: is Adam to be blamed for anticipating more pleasure from the consumption of the fruit than from following God’s command? In other words, was it possible for Adam to alter the intensity of his desire for the fruit? It seems that on Locke’s view, the answer must be connected to one of the powers he takes human beings to possess—the power to suspend desires. And, in certain passages of the Essay, Locke implies that suspending desires and freedom are linked, suggesting that while agents are acting freely whenever their volitions and actions are linked in the right kind of way, there is, perhaps, a proper use of the power to act freely.

d. Judgment

Locke asserts that the “highest perfection of intellectual nature” is the “pursuit of true and solid happiness.” He adds that taking care not to mistake imaginary happiness for real happiness is “the necessary foundation of our liberty.” And, he writes that the more closely we are focused on the pursuit of true happiness, which is our greatest good, the less our wills are determined to command actions to pursue lesser goods that are not representative of the true good (Essay, II.xxi.51). In other words, the more we are determined by true happiness, the more we will to suspend our desires for lesser things. This suggests that Locke takes there to be a right way to use our power of freedom. Locke indicates that there are instances where it is impossible to resist a particular desire—when a violent passion strikes, for instance. He also states, however, that aside from these kinds of violent passions, we are always able to suspend our desire for any thing in order to give ourselves the time and the emotional distance from the thing desired in which to consider the worth of thing relative to our general goal: true happiness. True happiness, or real bliss, on Locke’s view, is to be found in the pursuit of things that are true intrinsic goods, which promise “exquisite and endless Happiness” in the next life (Essay, II.xxi.70). In other words, true good is something like the Beatific Vision.

Now, Locke admits that it is a common experience to be carried by our wills towards things that we know do not play a role in our overall and true happiness. However, while he allows that the pursuit of things that promise pleasure, even if only a temporary pleasure, represents the action of a free agent, he also says that it is possible for us to be “at Liberty in respect of willing” when we choose “a remote Good as an end to be pursued” (Essay, II.xxi.56). The central thing to note here is that Locke is drawing a distinction between immediate and remote goods. The difference between these two kinds of goods is temporal. For instance, acting to obtain the pleasure of intoxication is to pursue an immediate good while acting to obtain the pleasure of health is to pursue a remote good. So, we can suppose here that Locke is suggesting that forgoing immediate goods and privileging remote goods is characteristic of the right use of liberty (but see Rickless for an alternative interpretation). If this is so, it is certainly not a difficult suggestion to accept. Indeed, it is fairly straightforwardly clear that many immediate pleasures do not, in the end, contribute to overall and long-lasting happiness.

The question now, and it is a question that Locke himself poses, is “How Men come often to prefer the worse to the better; and to chase that, which, by their own Confession, has made them miserable” (Essay, II.xxi.56). Locke gives two answers. First, bad luck can account for people not pursuing their true happiness. For instance, someone who is afflicted with an illness, injury, or tragedy is consumed by her pain and is thus unable to adequately focus on remote pleasures. Quoting Locke’s second answer “Other uneasinesses arise from our desire of absent good; which desires always bear proportion to, and depend on the judgment we make, and the relish we have of any absent good; in both which we are apt to be variously misled, and that by our own fault” (Essay, II.xxi.57).

Here Locke states that our own faulty judgment is to blame for our preferring the worse to the better. This is because, on his view, the uneasiness we have for any given object is directly proportional to the judgments we make about the merit of the things to which we are attracted. So, if we are most uneasy for immediate pleasures, it is our own fault because we have judged these things to be best for us. In this way, Locke makes room in his system for praiseworthiness and blameworthiness with respect to our desires: absent illness, injury, or tragedy, we ourselves are responsible for endorsing, through judgment, our uneasinesses. He continues, stating that the major reason why we often misjudge the value of things for our true happiness is that our current state fools us into thinking that we are, in fact, truly happy. Because it is difficult for us to consider the state of true, eternal happiness, we tend to think that in those moments when we enjoy pleasure and feel no uneasiness, we are truly happy. But such thoughts are mistaken on his view. Indeed, as Locke says, the greatest reason why so few people are moved to pursue the greatest, remote good is that most people are convinced that they can be truly happy without it.

The cause of our mistaken judgments is the fact that it is very difficult for us to compare present and immediate pleasures and pains with future or remote pleasures and pains. In fact, Locke likens this difficulty to the trouble we typically experience in correctly estimating the size of distant objects. When objects are close to us, it is easy to determine their size. When they are far away, it is much more difficult. Likewise, he says, for pleasures and pains. He notes that if every sip of alcohol were accompanied by headache and nausea, no one would ever drink. But, “the fallacy of a little difference in time” provides the space for us to mistakenly judge that the alcohol contributes to our true happiness (Essay, II.xxi.63). We experience this difficulty of judging remote pleasures and pains due to the “weak and narrow Constitution of our Minds” (Essay, II.xxi.64). The condition of our minds makes it easy for us to think that there could be no greater good than the relief of being unburdened of a present pain. In order to correct this problem and convince a man to judge that his greatest good is to be found in a remote thing, Locke says that all we must do is convince him that “Virtue and Religion are necessary to his Happiness” (Essay, II.xxi.60). Locke explains that a “due consideration will do it in most cases; and practice, application, and custom in most” (Essay, II.xxi.69). The suggestion is that contemplation and deliberation alone may be sufficient to correct our problem of considering all immediate pleasures and pains to be greater than any future ones. And, if that does not work, practice and habit can also correct this problem. By practice and exposure, we can, according to Locke, change the agreeableness or disagreeableness of things. It seems, then, that the power to suspend desire must be the power to reject immediate pleasures in favor of the pursuit of remote or future pleasures. However, it seems that in order to suspend in this way, we must already have judged that these immediate pleasures are not representative of the true good. For, without this kind of prior judgment, it seems that we would not be in a position to suspend in the way that is required. This is because absent the prior judgment, there would be no reason for the uneasiness we felt for the perceived good to not determine the will. The question to resolve now is how to get ourselves into a position where we are uneasy for the remote, true good and can suspend our desires for immediate pleasures. In other words, we must determine how we can come to seriously judge immediate pleasures to not have a part in our true happiness.

5. Living the Moral Life

In order to behave in a way that will lead us to the greatest and truest happiness, we must come to judge the remote and future good, the “unspeakable,” “infinite,” and “eternal” joys of heaven to be our greatest and thus most pleasurable good (Essay, II.xxi.37–38). But, on Locke’s view, our actions are always determined by the thing we are most uneasy about at any given moment. So, it seems, we need to cultivate the uneasiness for the infinite joys of heaven. But if, as Locke suggests, the human condition is such that our minds, in their weak and narrow states, judge immediate pleasures to be representative of the greatest good, it is difficult to see how, exactly, we can circumvent this weakened state in order to suspend our more terrestrial desires and thus have the space to correctly judge which things will lead to our true happiness. While in the Essay Locke does not say as much as we might like on this topic, elsewhere in his writings we can get a sense for how he might respond to this question.

In 1684, Locke was asked by his friend Edward Clarke, for advice about raising and educating his children. In 1693, Locke’s musings on this topic were published as Some Thoughts Concerning Education (hereafter: Education). This text provides insight into the importance that Locke places on the connection between the pursuit of true happiness and early childhood education in general. Locke begins his discussion by noting that happiness is crucially dependent on the existence of both a sound mind and a sound body. He adds that it sometimes happens that by a great stroke of luck, someone is born whose constitution is so strong that they do not need help from others to direct their minds towards the things that will make them happy. But this is an extraordinarily rare occurrence. Indeed, Locke notes: “I think I may say, that, of all the men we meet with, nine parts of ten are what they are, good or evil, useful or not, by their education” (Education, §1). It is the education we receive as young children, on Locke’s view, that determines how adept we are at targeting the right objects in order to secure our happiness. He observes that the minds of young children are easily distracted by all kinds of sensory stimuli and notes that the first step to developing a mind that is focused on the right kind of things is to ensure that the body is healthy. Indeed, the objective in physical health is to get the body in the perfect state to be able to obey and carry out the mind’s commands. The more difficult part of this equation is training the mind to “be disposed to consent to nothing, but what may be suitable to the dignity and excellency of a rational creature” (Education, §31). And Locke goes further still, stating that the foundation of all virtue is to be placed in the ability of a human being to “deny himself his own desires, cross his own inclinations, and purely follow what reason directs as best, though the appetite lean the other way” (Education, §33). The way to do this, he says, is to resist immediately present pleasures and pains and to wait to act until reason has determined the value of the desirable things in one’s environment.

Locke states that we must recognize the difference between “natural wants” and “wants of fancy.” The former are the kinds of desires that must be obeyed and that no amount of reasoning will allow us to give up. The latter, however, are created. Locke states that parents and teachers must ensure that children develop the habit of resisting any kind of created fancy, thus keeping the mind free from desires for things that do not lead to true happiness (Education, §107). If parents and teachers are successful in blocking the development of “wants of fancy,” Locke thinks that the children who benefit from this success will become adults who will be “allowed greater liberty” because they will be more closely connected to the dictates of reason and not the dictates of passion (Education, §108). So, in order to live the moral life and listen to reason over passions, it seems that we need to have had the benefit of conscientious care-givers in our infancy and youth (see also Government, II.63). This raises the difficulty of how to connect an individual’s moral successes or failures with the individual herself. For, if she had the bad moral luck of unthinking or careless parents and teachers, it seems difficult to see how she could be blamed for failing to follow a virtuous path.

One way of approaching this difficulty is to recall that Locke takes the content of law of nature, the moral law decreed by God, to be the preservation both of ourselves and of the other people in our communities in order to glorify God (Law, IV). The dictate to help to preserve the other people in our community shifts some of the moral burden from the individual onto the community. This means that it is every individual’s responsibility to do all they can, all things considered, to preserve themselves and to ensure, to the best of their ability, that the children in their communities are raised to avoid developing wants of fancy. In this way, children will develop the habit of suspending their desires for terrestrial pleasures and focusing their efforts on attaining the true happiness that results from acting to secure remote goods.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Edited by Peter H. Nidditch. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
    • This is the critical edition of Locke’s Essay. The body of the text is based on the fourth edition of the Essay and all the changes from the first edition through the fifth (1689, 1694, 1695, 1700, 1706) are indicated in the footnotes. The text also includes a comprehensive forward by Nidditch. Note that Locke’s orthography, grammar, and style are often quite different from the way that academic English is written today. In the citations from this text in particular, all emphases, capitalization, and odd spelling are original to Locke.
  • Essays on the Laws of Nature. Edited and translated by W. von Leyden. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1954.
    • This edition includes both the original Latin and the English translation of the essays. It also includes Locke’s valedictory speech as censor of moral philosophy at Christ Church and some other shorter pieces of writing. Von Leyden’s introduction provides a very detailed discussion of the sources of Locke’s arguments in these essays, the arguments themselves, and the relations these arguments bear to other of Locke’s writings. It is worth noting here that on von Leyden’s interpretation, it is not possible to render Locke’s discussion of natural law consistent with his endorsement of a hedonistic motivational system in later works.
  • Political Essays. Edited by Mark Goldie. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
    • This collection includes major writings on politics and government, including Essays on the Laws of Nature, Of Ethick in General, and An Essay on Toleration, in addition to many other minor essays.
  • The Correspondence of John Locke, in Eight Volumes. Edited by E.S. De Beer. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1976–89.
    • A complete database of Locke’s correspondence including notes about his correspondents, notes about events and proper names mentioned in letters, as well as signposts for what was going on in Locke’s life at the time he was writing. The first volume of the collection includes an exhaustive introduction to Locke’s life, work, and contacts in the academic and social world; an explanation of how Locke’s letters were preserved; a discussion of previous publications of Locke’s correspondence and how they relate to this collection; and information about transcription practices, including details about editorial grammar decision and dating of the letters.
  • The Works of John Locke, in Nine Volumes, 12th edition. London: Rivington, 1824.
    • This collection includes most of Locke’s longer texts, some shorter texts and a selection of letters. Among other things, the collection contains: Essay (vols.1 and 2), his correspondence with Stillingfleet (vol.3), Two Treatises of Government (vol.4), Letters on Toleration (vol.5), The Reasonableness of Christianity (vol.6), notes on St. Paul's Epistles (vol.7), Some Thoughts Concerning Education and A Discourse of Miracles (vol.8), and a selection of letters (vol.9).

b. Secondary Sources: Books

  • Aaron, Richard I. John Locke. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1971.
    • This is a comprehensive study of Locke’s life and works and includes fifteen very nice pages on Locke’s moral philosophy. Importantly, Aaron concludes that Locke fails to provide his readers  with a science of morals and, in fact, that Locke’s disparate comments about ethics and moral principles cannot be reconciled.
  • Colman, John. John Locke’s Moral Philosophy. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1983.
    • In this study, Colman addresses the major themes and problems of Locke’s moral theory including the connection between law and obligation, and the connection between moral principles and    demonstrability.
  • Darwall, Stephen. The British Moralists and the Internal 'Ought': 1640–1740. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • This is a deep and broad study of moral philosophy from the mid 17th to the mid 18th century. Locke is one among several central figures under discussion. The reader greatly benefits from Darwall’s careful discussions of the theoretical connections between Locke and his contemporaries and his influences on the topics of natural law, autonomy, motivation, duty, and freedom.
  • Lolordo, Antonia. Locke’s Moral Man. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2012.
    • In this study, Lolordo draws on different parts of the Essay in order to see Locke’s theory of agency. She argues in favor of the interpretation according to which there are two senses of freedom in Locke’s view, one of which is properly used to attain the goal proper to a moral agent. Of particular interest is her discussion that links Locke’s comments about personal identity to moral agency and her claim that, for Locke, metaphysics is unnecessary for ethics.
  • Mabbot, J.D. John Locke. London: Macmillan Press, 1973.
    • This is a study of Locke’s philosophical system that focuses on knowledge acquisition, logic and language, ethics and theology, and political theory. In his discussion of ethics and theology, Mabbot traces Locke’s discussions of moral principles, their demonstrability, and their binding force through The Two Treatises of GovernmentThe Essays on the Laws of Nature, and An Essay Concerning Human Understanding.
  • Schouls, Peter A. Reasoned Freedom: John Locke and Enlightenment. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1992.
    • This is a defense of the view that Locke was a great influence on enlightenment thought, in particular in the domains of reason and freedom. Schouls also points out what he takes to be       many inconsistencies across and sometimes within Locke’s texts.
  • Yaffe, Gideon. Liberty Worth the Name: Locke on Free Agency. New Jersey: Princeton University Press, 2000.
    • This is a book-length study of Locke’s view of human freedom. The content includes careful analysis of the chapter 'Of Power' of the Essay in addition to comments about how this chapter is connected to Locke’s discussion of personal identity. Yaffe defends an interpretation according to which Locke’s view contains two definitions of freedom, only one of which is “worth the name”—the kind of freedom that allows the pursuit of true good.

c. Secondary Sources: Articles

  • Chappell, Vere. “Locke on the Intellectual Basis of Sin.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 32 (1994): 197–207.
  • Chappell, Vere. “Locke on the Liberty of the Will.” In Locke’s Philosophy: Content and Context. Edited by G.A.J. Rogers, 101–21. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1994.
  • Chappell, Vere. “Power in Locke’s Essay.” In The Cambridge Companion to Locke’s “An Essay Concerning Human Understanding.” Edited by Lex Newman, 130–56. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007.
    • In these articles, Chappell advances the interpretation that changes made in the fifth edition of the Essay indicate that Locke changed his view about human freedom.
  • Darwall, Stephen. “The Foundations of Morality,” In The Cambridge Companion to Early Modern Philosophy. Edited by Donald Rutherford, 221–49.
    • This paper canvasses the main themes explored by and influences on early modern moral theories, including Locke’s.
  • Glauser, Richard. “Thinking and Willing in Locke’s Theory of Human Freedom,” Dialogue 42 (2003): 695–724.
    • Glauser argues that Locke’s view remains consistent across the changes made in the various editions of the Essay.
  • Magri, Tito. “Locke, Suspension of Desire, and the Remote Good,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy 8 (2000): 55–70.
    • Magri argues that Locke’s view changes over the course of the different editions of the Essay, in particular that he moves from having an “internalist” view of motivation to having an “externalist” view of motivation. Magri casts doubt on the consistency of Locke’s position.
  • Mathewson, Mark D. “John Locke and the Problems of Moral Knowledge,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 87 (2006): 509–26.
    • Mathewson argues that Locke’s comments about the nature of moral ideas leads to moral subjectivity and relativism.
  • Rickless, Samuel. “Locke on Active Power, Freedom, and Moral Agency,” Locke Studies 13 (2013): 31–51.
  • Rickless, Samuel. “Locke on the Freedom to Will.”  Locke Newsletter 31 (2000): 43–68.
    • In these papers, Rickless argues that Locke holds one and only one definition of freedom: the ability to act according to our volitions. According to Rickless, Locke holds the same definition of freedom as Hobbes. The 2013 paper is a direct argument against the interpretation advanced by Lolordo in Locke’s Moral Man.
  • Schneewind, J.B. “Locke’s Moral Philosophy,” The Cambridge Companion to Locke. Edited by Vere Chappell. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
    • Schneewind is one commentator who thinks that Locke’s moral philosophy ends up in a contradiction between the natural law view and hedonism.
  • Walsh, Julie. “Locke and the Power to Suspend Desire,” Locke Studies, 14 (2014).
    • Walsh argues that Locke’s view remains consistent and coherent across the various editions of the Essay and emphasizes the role played by suspension and judgment in attaining true happiness.


Author Information

Julie Walsh
Université du Québec à Montréal

Legal Validity

Legal validity governs the enforceability of law, and the standard of legal validity enhances or restricts the ability of the political ruler to enforce his will through legal coercion. Western law adopts three competing standards of legal validity. Each standard emphasizes a different dimension of law (Berman 1988, p. 779), and each has its own school of jurisprudence.

Legal positivism emphasizes law's political dimension. Legal positivism recognizes political rulers as the only source of valid law and adopts the will of the political ruler as its validity standard. Leading legal positivists include Jeremy Bentham, John Austin, and H.L.A. Hart.

Natural law theory emphasizes law's moral dimension. Natural law theory recognizes universal moral principles as the primary source of valid law. These moral principles provide a standard of legal validity that imposes moral limits on the ruler's coercive powers. Leading natural law theorists include Aristotle, Cicero, Justinian, and Thomas Aquinas.

The historicist school emphasizes law's historical dimension. The historicist school recognizes legal custom as the primary source of valid law. Legal custom provides a standard of legal validity that imposes customary limits on the political ruler's coercive powers. Leading historicists include Sir Edward Coke, John Selden, Sir Matthew Hale, and Sir William Blackstone.

Legal positivism recognizes positive law as the only real law and rejects law's moral and historical dimensions as sources of valid laws. Natural law theory and the historicist school, on the other hand, often integrate law's three dimensions. They recognize each dimension as a potential source of valid law but emphasize a particular dimension through their validity standard. Blackstone's unique jurisprudence adopts two validity standards, one from law's historical dimension, and one from law's moral dimension.

Standards of legal validity are historically cyclical. A society typically adopts a standard of legal validity based on moral principles, custom, or both. This validity standard restricts the ruler's ability to enforce his will through legal coercion. Then, intellectual challenges to moral principles and legal custom minimize their esteem. A new validity standard is adopted based on the will of the political ruler. Abuses of coercive powers by political rulers eventually stimulate renewed restrictions on those powers. The society adopts a revived standard of legal validity based on moral principles, custom, or both. The revived validity standard will typically endure until the memory of abuse fades, when the cycle begins again.

This cycle began with Hesiod in 700 B. C. E. and continued into the 21st Century. In common law jurisprudence, judicial acceptance of Hart's legal positivism eroded Blackstone's validity standards based on moral principles and custom. In civil law jurisprudence, Soviet and Nazi abuses of positivist legal systems revived validity standards based on moral principles. This essay describes the cycle of legal validity in Western law and proposes a fresh approach to legal validity to break this cycle.

Table of Contents

  1. The Sophists
  2. Plato
  3. Aristotle
  4. Cicero
  5. Justinian's Corpus Juris Civilis
  6. Aquinas
  7. Blackstone
  8. Bentham
  9. Austin
  10. Hart
  11. Radbruch
  12. Positivism in American Jurisprudence
  13. A Fresh Approach
  14. References and Further Reading

1. The Sophists

The first standard of legal validity in the Western legal tradition appears in Hesiod's religious poem Works and Days, circa 700 B. C. E. Hesiod presents an archetypal jurisprudence that integrates law's three dimensions. Dikê, the goddess of human justice, personifies law's moral dimension. Dikê's father Zeus personifies law's political dimension. Dikê's mother Thetis, the Titan embodiment of custom and social order, personifies law's historical dimension.

Justice "sets the laws straight with righteousness" and distinguishes men from beasts. Divinely decreed moral principles establish the validity standard for human law and customs, and conforming laws and customs establish the nomoi (law). Just men obey the nomoi, and obedience brings peace and prosperity. Disobedience brings punishment to the individual and his city through famine, plague, infertility, and military disaster.

The Sophists, wandering teachers of the fifth century B. C. E., challenged Greek conventions in religion, morality, and political conduct. They rejected Hesiod's moral dimension by rejecting the existence of divine lawgivers and universal moral principles. They rejected Hesiod's historical dimension by denying any normative authority to custom. Might was right, and law functioned only in the political dimension as the will of the strongest.

The Sophist Protagoras of Abdera (b. circa 481 B. C. E.), rejected law's moral dimension. As an agnostic, Protagoras rejected the divine lawgiver. As a moral relativist, Protagoras rejected the existence of universal moral principles. Unlike later Sophists, however, Protagoras accepted the validity of custom in law's historical dimension.

Protagoras based his moral relativism on the argument that a shared factual knowledge of the world is impossible. The foundation of Protagoras' relativism is the "man-measure" of the Aletheia (Truth). "Man is the measure of all things, of those that are that they are, of those that are not that they are not."

Sense perception forms the basis of all knowledge, Protagoras believed, and every sense impression that a person receives is securely true. The data of sense perception, however, are private, subjective states. The wind is truly warm to the man who perceives it as warm, but the same wind is truly cold to the man who perceives it as cold. Perceived objects therefore have contradictory properties and there are no public facts.

Protagoras maintained that all knowledge claims are thus equally true. Furthermore, their truth endures regardless of conflicting claims. Protagoras therefore claimed "it is equally possible to affirm and deny anything of anything." (Aristotle, Metaphysics, 1007b).

Protagoras extended his doctrine that all knowledge claims are equally true to claim that all virtue claims are equally true. Virtue claims are relative to the claimant because virtue is only another form of knowledge. (Plato, Protagoras, 323a-328d). There are no universal moral principles, and law's moral dimension does not exist.

Although Protagoras rejected law's moral dimension, he embraced law's historical dimension. Although all knowledge and virtue claims are equally true, Protagoras argued they are not all equally sound. Only the ignorant equated truth with soundness. One set of thoughts can therefore be "better than another, but not in any way truer." The same is true of laws. All laws are equally true, but not all laws are equally sound.

Protagoras accepted a duty to obey the law. Since no moral or legal code is truer than any other, no individual should assert his moral or legal judgments over those advanced by the state. Society is required to preserve humanity. The perpetuation of society, in turn, requires respect for law and custom. Men should obey the state's laws and customs so long as they function soundly. (Plato, Protagoras, 322d; Theaetetus, 167b).

The Sophist Callicles (b. circa 484 B. C. E.), rejected law's historical dimension and denied any duty to obey the law. Using "nature" to mean the antithesis of mind, Callicles argued that nature's normative authority (phusis) supersedes the normative authority of man's laws and customs (nomoi). Man's laws and customs violate "nature's own law" and "natural justice." Nature's law, not man's, should govern our actions.

Callicles said that what men call "right" merely expresses what men believe to be to their advantage. Legal conventions in democracies wrongfully elevate the weak over the strong. The majority of weaker folk frame the laws for their advantage to prevent the stronger from gaining advantage over them. The true nature of right is established by nature, not men, and nature's law establishes right in the strong. Natural justice provides that the better and wiser man should rule over and have more than the inferior. Might, therefore, makes right. All animals and races of man recognize right as the sovereignty and advantage of the stronger over the weaker. (Plato, Gorgias, 483b-d, 490a).

The Sophist Thrasymachus (b. circa 459 B. C. E.) argued for disobeying laws and customs. Defining justice as obedience to the laws, Thrasymachus argues that justice is nothing but the advantage of the stronger. Obedience furthers the advantage of others and reduces the obedient to a form of slavery. Only disobedience to law profits a man and leads to his advantage. Injustice is therefore "a stronger, freer, and more masterful thing than justice." (Plato, Republic, 338c-344c).

Solon's constitution created an archetypal positivist legal system in Athens in 594 B. C. E. Solon reposed political and judicial authority in the heliastic courts. The courts enforced undefined laws with no standard of legal validity other than the unrestrained will of the jurors. Pericles' introduction of payments for jurors in 451 B. C. E. enthroned Athens' poorest and least educated class as dikasts in the heliastic courts. The Athenian courts became infamous for injustice and gullibility. Xenophon writes that Athenian courts often acted on emotion to put innocent men to death and acquit wrongdoers. (Xenophon 1990, pp.41-42). Eighty dikasts who found Socrates innocent voted for his death.

Athenian ostracism (ostrakismos) permitted the conviction, exile, and execution of any Athenian without charges, hearing, or defense. Originally intended for removing tyrants, Plutarch records that ostracism quickly became a way of pacifying jealousy of the eminent. Ostracism breathed out malice in exile and death. Every one was liable to it whose reputation, birth, or eloquence rose above the common level. (Plutarch 1914, pp. 2, 230, 233).

Athens ostracized its greatest heroes from envy of their honors. Athens ostracized Aristides, the hero of the Battle of Marathon, in 483 B. C. E. Athens ostracized Themistocles, savior of Athens at the Battle of Salamis, in 471 B. C. E. Both men were exiled for ten years without charges or a hearing.

Lack of procedural safeguards encouraged frivolous public prosecutions (graphai) and impeachments (eisangeliai), giving free reign to Athens' gullible and imprudent dikasts. Frivolous political prosecutions destroyed Athens' leadership, spawning bloody regime changes and military disasters. The frivolous prosecution of Pericles in 443 B. C. E. precipitated the Peloponnesian War with Sparta. The frivolous prosecution of Alcibiades in 415 B. C. E. caused Athens' ablest general to switch sides and lead Sparta against Athens.

The greatest ignominy involves the Arginusae generals in 404 B. C. E. Six Athenian naval commanders won a great naval victory against Sparta at Arginusae. A violent storm prevented their recovering the dead and shipwrecked. The generals were nevertheless impeached and executed for failing to do so. Deprived of her best generals, Athens lost the war the next year in a devastating naval defeat at Aegospotami.

Political prosecutions wreaked political havoc as well. Five regime changes rocked Athens between 411 B. C. E. and 403 B. C. E. These regimes included the reign of terror by the Thirty Tyrants in 404 B. C. E.

Athenian positivism criminalized thought and expression in frivolous prosecutions against philosophers. Anaxagoras circa 430 B. C. E., Protagoras circa 415 B. C. E., and Socrates in 399 B. C. E. were all convicted on manufactured charges of impiety (asebeia). Impiety was undefined by Athenian law. Every juror defined it anew in every case as he pleased.

Athens often regretted its decisions. Socrates' lead accuser Anytus was stoned for his role in Socrates' death. Athens honored Socrates with a bronze statue by Lysippus. Athens thus gained “the indelible reproach of decreeing to the same citizens the hemlock on one day and statues on the next.” (Hamilton 2010, p. 289).

2. Plato

Plato described Socrates as the bravest, wisest, and most upright man of his time. Plato planned a career in politics but "withdrew in disgust" after observing how Athenian courts "corrupted the written laws and customs." (Plato, Letter VII, 325a-c). Plato reacted to Socrates' death by repudiating the Sophists, reviving law's moral and historical dimensions, and formulating a natural law standard of legal validity based on principles of universal justice.

Plato begins his revival of law's historical dimension by emphasizing the autonomy of law, which he considered the most important aspect of government. Autonomous laws wield supremacy over political rulers. Political rulers are subject to the same laws as other citizens, and they may not alter the laws to suit their will.

Plato wrote that the preservation or ruin of a community depends on the autonomy of laws more than anything else. Respecting law's autonomy preserves the entire community. Disregarding it brings destruction. Autonomy is so important that "the man who is most perfect in obedience to established law" should receive the highest post in government. The second most obedient man should receive the second highest post, and so on for all the posts. (Plato, Laws, 715c-d.)

Plato begins his revival of law's moral dimension by persuasively refuting Protagoras' moral relativism in the Theaetetus. Protagoras claimed that all sense perceptions are equally true. Since knowledge is perception, all knowledge claims are equally true. Since moral claims are a species of knowledge claims, all moral claims are equally true. Therefore, no one set of moral principles has authority to guide the laws.

Plato offers eleven objections to Protagoras' arguments in the Theaetetus. Three are recounted here. First, Plato denies that knowledge is perception. If knowledge were perception, we would understand anyone speaking to us in a foreign tongue. This is clearly not the case. Second, remembered knowledge refutes Protagoras' claim that knowledge is perception. Remembered knowledge involves no perception, but it is knowledge nonetheless.

Third, moral relativism is self-refuting. Assume, as Protagoras claims, that "all beliefs are true." Assume also that another man exists who believes that "not all beliefs are true." If Protagoras is correct, then the second man's belief must be true. Protagoras' belief that "all beliefs are true" is thus refuted. (Plato, Theaetetus, 160e-177b).

Plato continues his revival of law's moral and historical dimensions in the Crito. The Crito considers whether a duty exists to obey the law. Socrates' friend Crito argues for Socrates to escape and avoid his unjust execution.

Socrates replies that the soul is more precious than the body. Good actions benefit our souls, but wrong actions mutilate them. The important thing is not living, but living well. This means living honorably. Socrates utilizes three principles in determining whether to escape. First, circumstances never justify wrong action. Second, one should not injure others, even when they injure you. Third, one "ought to honor one's agreements, provided they are right." (Plato, Crito, 47e-49e).

Plato defines law's moral dimension through these principles. Justinian's Corpus Juris Civilis defines its moral dimension by these same principles in the sixth century. (Justinian, Digest, 1.1.10). Blackstone's Commentaries does the same in the eighteenth century. (Blackstone 1828, p. 27).

Plato next refutes Thrasymachus' claim in the Republic that disobeying the law "is a stronger, freer, and more masterful thing" than obeying the law. In the Crito's "Speech of the Laws," the Laws present two arguments for obedience. The first is the "argument from agreement." Socrates has undertaken to live his life in obedience to Athens' laws. Athens did not force Socrates to live in its precincts. Socrates was free to leave at any time. By choosing to stay in Athens with full knowledge of how the laws functioned, Socrates promised obedience to the laws.

The Laws' orders are "in the form of proposals, not savage commands." Socrates can either obey the Laws or persuade (the personification of) the Law that they are at fault. If Socrates escapes without persuading the personification of the Laws that they were at fault, he would dishonor his agreement to obey the laws. Dishonoring a just agreement violates the ethic of "living well" and damages the soul.

The Laws' second argument is the "argument from injury." Disobedience destroys both the Laws and the city, which cannot exist if legal judgments are ignored. Socrates concludes that "both in war and in the law courts and everywhere else you must do whatever your city and your country command, or else persuade them in accordance with universal justice" that they are at fault.

The Laws' second argument implies a natural law standard of validity based on principles of universal justice. The Laws insist they operate as "proposals, not savage commands." Socrates' duty to obey the Laws is contingent on the Laws' compliance with principles of universal justice. By implication, there is no duty to obey the Laws if they violate principles of universal justice. (Plato, Crito, 51e-52d).

3. Aristotle

Aristotle designs his legal philosophy to avoid the catastrophes described in his Athenian Constitution. Aristotle accepts the necessity of law's political dimension because laws cannot enforce themselves. Nevertheless, the Athenian legal history proves the political dimension is not sufficient to preserve a society or achieve its happiness.

Human nature demands more than political power from law. Law must accomplish justice and foster virtue. Justice is required to prevent revolution, and virtue is required for human happiness. Man separated from justice is "the worst of animals," and man without virtue "is the most unholy and the most savage of animals." (Aristotle, Politics 1253a).

Aristotle writes in the Politics that securing justice is the state's most important function. Justice is more essential to the state than providing the necessities of life. Governments must be founded on justice to endure. Governments that rule unjustly and give unequal treatment to similarly placed subjects provoke revolutions. Justice maintained, however, forms a bond between the members of society that preserves the state. (Aristotle, Politics 1328b, 1332b, 1253a).

Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics defines justice as lawfulness concerned with the common advantage and happiness of the political community. Aristotle distinguishes between legal justice (to nomikon dikaion) and natural justice (physikon dikaion). Legal justice involves positive laws and custom enacted by man, such as conventional measures for grain and wine. These “are just not by nature but by human enactment” and “are not everywhere the same.”Aristotle secures legal justice by granting autonomy to law and by utilizing custom to encourage obedience. (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, 1134b-1135a).

Natural justice, on the other hand, involves principles of natural law that originate in nature. Such principles do not arise in the minds of men “by people’s thinking this or that.” Natural law principles apply with equal force everywhere, just as fire burns both in Greece and in Persia. Aristotle secures natural justice by adopting natural law precepts as the standard of legal validity. Positive laws that violate natural law precepts are nullified. (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, 1134b).

Aristotle secures legal justice by restricting the will of the political ruler through autonomous laws. The Politics teaches that unrestrained power produces tyranny, even in democracies. Aristotle considers whether societies function best under the "rule of men" or the "rule of law." He concludes that laws, when good, should be supreme. Political rulers should merely complement the law by acting as its guardians and ministers. They should only regulate those matters on which the laws are unable to speak with precision owing to the difficulty of any general principle embracing all particulars. (Aristotle, Politics, 1282b).

Aristotle gives four reasons for emphasizing law's autonomy over the will of the political ruler. First, law frees the state from the desires and passions that afflict political rulers. "The law is reason unaffected by desire. Desire … is a wild beast, and passion perverts the minds of rulers, even when they are the best of men." (Aristotle, Politics, 1287a). Second, tyranny results when political rulers exercise autonomy over law, even in democracies. Third, the orderly rotation of political offices requires autonomous laws. Equality, liberty, justice, and expediency mandate that every mature citizen participates in governing the state. Fourth, the orderly rotation of political offices preserves the state by assuring evenhanded administration by magistrates.

Aristotle utilizes law's historical dimension to secure legal justice through custom. Aristotle uses the term nomos for law, and nomos includes custom and convention as components of the social norm. Aristotle writes in the Politics that legal custom is itself a form of justice. Custom and convention maintain social stability by encouraging obedience to the law. The law has no power to command obedience except that of habit, which can only be given by time. Aristotle urges caution in changing the law because changes enfeeble the power of the law. If the advantage of a change is small, it is wiser to leave errors in the law. The citizens usually lose more by the habit of disobedience than they gain by changing the law. (Aristotle, Politics, 1255a, 1269a).

Aristotle utilizes law's moral dimension to secure natural justice in two ways. The first is by nullifying positive laws that subvert natural law precepts. Aristotle formulates a natural law standard of legal validity. Aristotle's Rhetoric describes natural law as an unwritten law, based on nature, and common to all people. "There is in nature a common principle of the just and unjust that all people in some way divine." (Aristotle, Rhetoric, 1373b).

Natural law provides immutable and universal standards of justice. Natural law constitutes a separate body of binding law that exceeds positive law in authority. Human actions should complete nature rather than subvert it, and natural law nullifies positive laws that subvert natural law precepts. (Aristotle, Rhetoric, 1373b).

Like Plato, Aristotle argues that the universal standards of natural law justify disobeying positive laws. Aristotle's Rhetoric provides two examples invalidating positive law for violating natural law precepts. The first is the case of Sophocles' Antigone, where Antigone disobeys Creon's order and provides funeral rites to her brother Polyneices. The second is Aristotle's guide to jury nullification of written law by appealing to higher principles of natural law. (Aristotle, Rhetoric, 1373b, 1375a-b).

Aristotle never explains why natural law wields supremacy over positive law. The supremacy of natural law is consistent, however, with Aristotle's view in the Physics that the ultimate causes of nature are divine. (Aristotle, Physics, 198b-199b).

The second way that Aristotle secures natural justice is by fostering virtue. Aristotle believed that human happiness depended on virtue more than liberty. The government is thus responsible for producing a virtuous state, and this is best accomplished through law. Although virtue encompasses more than mere conformity to law, virtue will only develop and flourish in a state that supports the legal enforcement of virtue. The state must provide moral education through its laws to make its citizens just and good. Failing to do so undermines the state's political system and harms its citizens. (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, 1179b; Politics, 1280b, 1310a, 1337a).

4. Cicero

Marcus Tullius Cicero (106-43 B. C. E.) was a politician, philosopher, orator, and attorney. Cicero's De Legibus (The Laws), De Officis (On Duties), and De Re Publica (The Republic) greatly influence the natural law tradition. Cicero esteemed Plato and Aristotle. Although not a Stoic, Cicero adopted Stoicism's divine Nature as the source of natural law precepts that dictate legal validity. The histories of Herodotus, Thucydides, Xenophon, and Polybius persuaded Cicero that natural law imposes justice on human events.

Cicero's signature contribution to jurisprudence is his explication of Nature as divine lawgiver. Law and justice originate in Nature as a divinely ordained set of universal moral principles. Cicero describes Nature as the omnipotent ruler of the universe, the omnipresent observer of every individual's intentions and actions, and the common master of all people. Belief in divine Nature stabilizes society, encourages obedience to law, and leads to individual virtue. (Cicero, De Legibus, 2.15-16).

Law's moral dimension dominates Cicero's jurisprudence. Cicero defines natural law as perfect reason in commanding and prohibiting. These principles are the sole source of justice and provide the sole standard of legal validity. "True law is right reason in agreement with Nature." (Cicero, De Re Publica, 3.33).

The precepts of natural law are eternal and immutable. They apply universally at all places, at all times, and to all people. Natural law summons to duty by its commands, and averts from wrongdoing by its prohibitions. Nature serves as the enforcing judge of natural law precepts, and Nature's punishment for violating natural law precepts is inescapable. (Cicero, De Re Publica, 3.33).

Natural law provides the naturae norma, the standard of legal validity for positive law and custom. The naturae norma provides the only means for separating good provisions from bad. Justice entails that laws and customs comply with the naturae norma and preserve the peace, happiness, and safety of the state and its citizens. Positive laws and customs that fail to do so are not regarded as laws at all. (Cicero, De Legibus, 1.44, 2.11-2.14).

Regarding Cicero's political dimension of law, the magistrate's limited role is to govern and to issue orders that are just and advantageous in keeping with the laws. Although the magistrate has some control of the people, the laws are fully in control of the magistrate. An official is the speaking law, and the law is a nonspeaking official. (Cicero, De Legibus, 3.2).

Political rulers cannot alter, repeal, or abolish natural law precepts. Furthermore, political rulers have no role in interpreting or explaining natural law precepts. Every man can discern the precepts of natural law for himself through reason. (Cicero, De Re Publica, 3.33).

Political rulers must issue just commands as measured by natural law precepts. Individuals are protected against unjust coercion. Although rulers may use sanctions to enforce legitimate commands, every affected subject has the right to appeal to the people before enforcement of any sanction. Furthermore, no ruler can issue commands concerning single individuals. Any significant sanction against an individual, such as execution or loss of citizenship, is reserved to the highest assembly of the people. As a further protection, all laws must be officially recorded by the censors. (Cicero, De Re Publica, 2.53-2.54; De Legibus, 3.10-3.47).

Like Aristotle, Cicero requires that magistrates be subject to the power of others. Successive terms are forbidden, and ten years must pass before the magistrate becomes eligible for the same office. Every magistrate leaving office must submit an account of his official acts to the censors. Misconduct is subject to prosecution. No magistrate may give or receive any gifts while seeking or holding office, or after the conclusion of his term. (Cicero, De Legibus, 3.9-3.11).

Regarding Cicero's historical dimension of law, Cicero agrees with Aristotle that custom maintains social stability by encouraging obedience to law. Custom can even achieve immortality for the commonwealth. The commonwealth will be eternal if citizens conduct their lives in accordance with ancestral laws and customs. (Cicero, De Re Publica, 3.41).

5. Justinian's Corpus Juris Civilis

The Corpus Juris Civilis (Body of Civil Law) codified Roman law pursuant to the decree of Justinian I. Completed in A.D. 535, the four works of the Corpus became the sole legal authorities in the empire. The Institutes was a law school text. The Codex contained statutes dating from A.D. 76. The Digest contained commentaries by leading jurists, and the New Laws was supplemented as new laws became necessary.

The Corpus is the direct ancestor of modtern Wester civil law systems. Its influence on canon law is seen in the medieval maim Ecclesia vivit lege romana (the Church lives on Roman law). Common law jurisprudence never accepted the Corpus as binding authority. Nevertheless, its twelfth century revival profoundly influenced the formation of common law jurisprudence through the works of the father of the common law, Henry de Bracton (C. E. 1210 – C. E. 1268).

The Corpus divides law into public law involving state interests and private law governing individuals. Private law is a mixture of natural law, the law of nations, and municipal law. The Corpus establishes a clear hierarchy among law's three dimensions. The moral dimension occupies the highest position and provides the standard of legal validity. The historical dimension of legal custom occupies the second position, and the political dimension of Roman municipal law occupies the lowest position.

The Corpus' moral dimension resides in two bodies of law, natural law and the law of nations. Like Cicero, the Corpus originates natural law in a divine lawgiver. "The laws of nature, which are observed by all nations alike, are established by divine providence." The precepts of natural law are universal, eternal, and immutable. (Justinian, Institutes, 1.2.11; Digest, 1.3.2).

Natural law governs all land, air, and sea creatures, including man. "The law of nature is that which she has taught all animals; a law not peculiar to the human race, but shared by all living creatures." The Corpus extends natural law to "all living creatures" to repudiate the Sophist arguments that law is merely a human convention with no basis in nature, justice does not exist, and there is no duty to obey law. The Corpus' rebuttal focuses on the highly socialized behavior of such animal species as ants, bees, and birds. Although animals cannot legislate or form social conventions, they nevertheless follow norms of behavior. These norms affirm the existence of natural law. (Justinian, Institutes, 1.1.3, 2.1.11).

The Institutes and the Digest state three precepts of natural law: "Honeste vivere, alterum non laedere, suum cuique tribuere." Live honorably, injure no one, and give every man his due. (Justinian, Institutes, 1.1.3; Digest, 1.1.10). These precepts track the Crito's admonishments to live well, harm no one, and honor agreements so long as they are honorable. (Plato, Crito, 47e-49e). Blackstone's Commentaries adopts these exact precepts. (Blackstone 1828, p. 27).

The law of nations is the portion of natural law that governs relations between human beings. (Justinian, Digest, 1.4). Its rules are "prescribed by natural reason for all men" and "observed by all peoples alike." The law of nations is the source of duties to God, one's parents, and one's country. It recognizes human rights to life, liberty, and self-defense, and its recognition of property rights enables contracts and commerce between peoples.

The precepts of natural law provide the standard for legal validity. This standard voids any right or duty violating natural law precepts. The Institutes provides illustrative examples: Contracts created for immoral purposes, such as carrying out a homicide or a sacrilege, are not enforceable. (Justinian, Institutes, 3.19.24). Immorality invalidates wrongful profits. Anyone profiting from wrongful dominion over another's property must disgorge those profits.(Justinian, Digest, 5.3.52).

Immorality invalidates agency relationships. Agents are not obliged to carry out immoral instructions from their principals. If they do, they are not entitled to indemnity from their principals for any liability the agents incur. (Justinian, Institutes, 3.26.7). Immorality even invalidates bequests and legacies if the bequest is contingent upon immoral conduct.(Justinian, Institutes, 2.20.36).  

The Corpus' historical dimension provides custom as a source of enforceable law. The Corpus defines legal custom as the tacit consent of a people established by long-continued habit. Since custom evidences the consent of the people, it is a higher source of law than positive or statutory law.Statutory provisions, if customarily ignored, are treated like repealed legislation. (Justinian, Digest, 1.1.3).

Legal custom establishes the autonomy of law over political rulers. Custom binds judges. A judge's first duty is "to not judge contrary to statutes, the imperial laws, and custom." Legal custom even controls statutory interpretation. "Custom is the best interpreter of statutes." (Justinian, Institutes, 4.17; Digest, 1.1.37).

The Corpus' political dimension resides in its six categories of Roman municipal law, the "statutes, plebiscites, senatusconsults, enactments of the Emperors, edicts of the magistrates, and answers of those learned in the law." In contrast to natural law and the law of nations, Roman municipal law was unique to Rome. Its provisions were also "subject to frequent change, either by the tacit consent of the people, or by the subsequent enactment of another statute." (Justinian, Institutes, 1.2.3, 1.2.11).

6. Aquinas

Thomas Aquinas' Summa Theologica recognizes all three dimensions of law as potential sources of valid law. The moral dimension wields supremacy, however, through a rigid standard of legal validity. Human laws that fail this standard are not merely unenforceable; they are "perversions of law," "acts of violence," and "no law at all." (Aquinas, Summa Theologica, quest. 94 art. 4; quest. 95 art. 2).

Common law jurisprudence has never accepted Aquinas' natural law theory. It differs in important ways from Blackstone's natural law theory. Thomism nevertheless influenced the philosophical method taught in Roman Catholic institutions. Martin Luther King Jr. invoked Aquinas' natural law theory in the Birmingham jail to justify civil disobedience, and Aquinas' theory motivates contemporary opponents of abortion and euthanasia.

Question 97 establishes both God and man as lawgivers. Divine and natural law come from the rational will of God. Human law comes from the will of man, regulated by reason. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 97 art. 3).

Question 90 defines four existence conditions for law. The first condition is that law is an ordinance of reason, that law is created by a being with reason to achieve a goal. The second condition is that the law has the common good as its goal and that laws must distribute their burdens equitably and proportionately among their subjects. The third condition is a lawgiver who has care of the community because unless the lawgiver holds sufficient power to coerce obedience, the law cannot induce its subjects to virtue. The fourth condition is publication, which is required for law to have the binding force to compel obedience. Each condition is necessary for law, and together they are sufficient. Failing any condition renders a purported law an act of violence. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 96 art. 1-4).

Question 91 divides law into four types. Eternal law is the set of timeless truths that govern the movement and behavior of all things in the universe, including human beings. Divine law is the word of God revealed to man to guide him to his supernatural end. God reveals divine law to operate because human reason is inadequate to discover its precepts. Natural law is that portion of the eternal law that governs the behavior of human beings. Natural law is derived from eternal law, and its precepts are discovered by reason. Human law is any law of human authorship. Man creates human law in order to implement the precepts of natural law. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 91 art. 1-4).

Question 94 presents Aquinas' theory of natural law. God writes natural law in the hearts of men, and man discerns the natural law using practical reason. Four natural inclinations enable man to discern the precepts of natural law. The first is an inclination to seek after good. The second is an inclination to preserve one's own according to one's nature. Man shares these first two inclinations with all substances. The third is an inclination to reproduce, raise, and educate one's offspring. Man shares this inclination with animals. The fourth is an inclination "to know the truth about God and to live in society." This inclination is unique to man. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 94 art. 2).

Aquinas divides natural law into "first principles" and "secondary principles." First principles are unchanging. They are always known by all human beings and they are binding on all human beings. They are mutually consistent, and conflict between them is impossible. They cannot be "blotted out from men's hearts." (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 94 art. 6).

The first principles of natural law contain four precepts, each reflecting one of man's natural inclinations. The first precept is to pursue good and avoid evil. The second is to preserve life and ward off its obstacles. The third is to reproduce, raise, and educate one's offspring. The fourth is to pursue knowledge and to live together in society. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 94 art. 2).

Secondary principles of natural law differ significantly from first principles. Secondary principles are subject to change, albeit rarely and for special causes. They are not always known by all persons and they are not always binding. These differences result from practical reason's susceptibility to perversion by passion, evil habits, and evil dispositions. Lastly, secondary principles can be blotted out from men's hearts through "evil persuasions," errors in "speculative matters," vicious customs," and "corrupt habits." (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 94 art. 6).

Secondary principles form three categories. The first involves secondary principles that are always known by all persons and are always binding, such as "do not murder or slay the innocent." The second category involves principles that are always binding but not always known, such as "do not steal." Julius Caesar reports in the Gallic Wars, for example, that the Germans did not know it was wrong to steal. The third category involves principles that are not always binding, such as "goods entrusted to another should be restored." Although usually binding, this principle does not bind the return of another's weapons to be used against one's country. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 94 art. 4).

Questions 95 through 97 discuss human law. Human law exists because the great variety of human affairs prevents the first principles of natural law from being applied to all men in the same way. Human reason derives human law from natural law precepts for particular matters, and this process creates a diversity of positive law among different peoples. The "force" accorded to human law depends on the method by which it is derived from natural law. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 95 art. 2).

Aquinas specifies two methods. The first method involves taking a "conclusion" from a premise of natural law. As in science, reason draws specific conclusions of human law by demonstration from natural law principles. Reason demonstrates the human law conclusion that "one must not kill" from the natural law principle that "one should do harm to no man." Human laws derived by this method have some force of natural law. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 95 art. 2).

The second method for deriving human law involves making a "determination" from generalities of natural law. As in the arts, details are derived from general forms. A carpenter begins with the general form of a house in his mind, but he must determine the details of its construction as he builds it. Reason determines that murderers should be imprisoned for twenty years from the natural law principle that evildoers should be punished. Unlike conclusions of human law, determinations have no force of natural law. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 95 art. 2).

Question 96 provides a narrow scope for human law. Human laws should not repress all the vices forbidden by natural law. Since most people are incapable of abstaining from all vices, human law should only prohibit those vices whose suppression is essential for preserving society. Human laws should prohibit murder and theft but remain silent as to lesser vices. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 96 art. 2).

The Summa provides a fully developed standard of legal validity. Question 96 provides that human laws must be just. Justice requires that human laws accomplish both divine good and human good as described below. Unjust laws are not merely unenforceable; they are perversions of law and acts of violence, and they are powerless to bind the conscience. They are, in fact, not laws at all. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 96 art. 4).

Human laws accomplish divine good by satisfying the requirements of natural law and divine law. Purported laws that conflict with divine good, natural law or divine law should always be disobeyed. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 96 art. 4).

Human laws accomplish human good if and only if they meet three conditions. First, the end of the law must be the common good. Second, the human lawgiver must not exceed his power in establishing the law. Third, the burdens of the law must be shared equitably and proportionately by all members of society. Failure to meet any of these conditions renders the purported law unjust. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 96 art. 4).

Purported laws that conflict with human good are unjust and may usually be disobeyed. If the purported law fails to meet one of the standards for human good, it may be disobeyed. An exception arises, however, if disobedience results in "greater harm" or creates a scandal. The unjust human law should then be obeyed, even though it is not truly a law. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 96 art. 4).

Critics often charge that Aquinas' claim that "an unjust law is no law at all" is incoherent. This criticism seemingly disregards Aquinas' definition of law in Question 95. Laws have "just so much of the nature of law" as they are derived from natural law. Natural law is always just. To be considered law "at all," therefore, human laws must be just. A purported law that is unjust is not truly a law. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 95 art. 2).

7. Blackstone

Sir William Blackstone's Commentaries on the Laws of England is the standard statement of common law jurisprudence. Blackstone imposes two standards of legal validity, one based on custom and the other on natural law. Purported laws that fail these standards are not merely "bad law," they are "not law." (Blackstone 1838, p. 47).

Law's historical dimension provides the validity standard based on custom and serves as the primary source of human law. The historical dimension also emphasizes the autonomy of custom over the will of political rulers. Law's moral dimension provides the validity standard based on natural law. The moral dimension also establishes natural rights as limits on the will of the political ruler and protects these rights through due process. The political dimension provides only a limited source of law, and the historical and moral dimensions severely restrict the political ruler's ability to enforce his will through legal coercion.

Law's historical dimension dominates Blackstone's jurisprudence. Custom is "the first ground and chief corner stone" of common law. Custom includes rules of law, such as the rule of primogeniture, which says the oldest male descendant inherits the entire estate. Custom also includes legal principles in the forms of maxims, such as "the king can do no wrong," "no man is bound to accuse himself," and "no man ought to benefit from his own wrong." Law’s historical dimension is so strong in common law that approved statutes were strictly construed and interpreted whenever possible to comply with pre-existing custom. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 46, 50).

Blackstone divides customary law into three types. The first type, "general customs," applies to the entire kingdom. The second type, "particular customs," only apply to limited regions or specialized groups like merchants. For illustration, the "general custom" of inheritance for England is primogeniture where the eldest son inherits all. Nevertheless, the "particular custom" of gavelkind permits shared inheritance in Kent. The third type, "peculiar laws," includes Roman civil law and Catholic canon law. These laws have no authority in England except as the people have consented to their provisions through customary observance. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 45-57).

The validity standard for custom includes seven requirements. First, the custom must "have been used so long, that the memory of man runs not to the contrary." Proof of any time when the custom did not exist voids the custom. Second, the custom must enjoy continuous observance, interruption voids the custom. Third, the custom must enjoy peaceable observance. Custom depends upon consent, and disputed customs lack consent. Fourth, customs must be "reasonable" and must not create unnecessary hardships.Fifth, the custom must be certain. A custom that the worthiest son inherits is void because no certain standard for worthiness exists. Sixth, compliance must be mandatory. Optional customs have no coercive force. Lastly, customs must be consistent. Inconsistent customs lack mutual consent. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 53-55).

Law's moral dimension provides a standard of legal validity based on natural law. Blackstone's natural law founds justice on the eternal and immutable laws of good and evil to which the creator himself conforms. God is a being of infinite power, infinite wisdom, and infinite goodness. Although God endows man with reason and free will, man is still "entirely dependent" on God. Man is subject to God's law, and God's law is natural law. Natural law is binding over the entire globe, in all countries, and at all times. No human laws are of any validity if they conflict with natural law, and valid human laws derive all their force and authority from natural law.

Natural law precepts are discernible by reason as far as they are necessary for the conduct of human actions. Unlike Aquinas, however, Blackstone regards human reason as "frail, imperfect, and blind" since man's fall. To overcome these defects of human reason, God reveals the precepts of natural law through direct revelation in scripture. The validity of human law depends on the two foundations of natural law and revealed law. Human laws contradicting their precepts are void.

Natural law permits acts that promote true happiness and prohibits acts that destroy it. Natural law derives from the precept “that man should pursue his own true and substantial happiness.” God created human nature so that man obtains happiness by pursuing justice. Injustice brings unhappiness.

Substantively, natural law consists of eternal immutable laws of good and evil. Blackstone adopts three precepts of natural law from Justinian's Institutes. “Such, among others, are these principles: that we should live honestly, should hurt nobody, and should render to every one his due; to which three general precepts Justinian has reduced the whole doctrine of law.” (Blackstone 1838, pp. 27-28).

Blackstone divides jurisprudence into natural law and positive law. Positive law provisions contrary to natural law are invalid. Individuals are furthermore bound to disobey them, such as laws requiring murder. Nevertheless, natural law does not determine every legal issue. Natural law is indifferent, for example, as to whether positive law permits the export of wool. On most issues, man is at liberty to adopt positive laws that benefit society. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 28-29).

Blackstone divides rights into two types, absolute rights and relative rights. The “immutable laws of nature” vest absolute rights in individuals. Individuals enjoy absolute rights in the state of nature, prior to the formation of society. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 88, 94).

Blackstone names three absolute rights: personal security, personal liberty, and private property. The absolute right of personal security consists of the legal enjoyment of life, limb, body, health, and reputation. The absolute right of personal liberty consists of the free power of movement without imprisonment or restraint unless by due course of law. The absolute right of property consists of the free use and disposal of lawful acquisitions, without injury or illegal diminution. (Blackstone 1838, pp 93-100).

Relative rights, in contrast to absolute rights, exist only in society. Relative rights protect and maintain inviolate the three absolute rights of personal security, personal liberty, and private property. Unlike absolute rights, which are few and simple, relative rights are more numerous and more complicated. Such rights include due process protections as well as "Blackstone's ratio," which says it is better that ten guilty persons escape than one innocent party suffers. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 89, 102).

Law's political dimension is severely delimited in Blackstone's jurisprudence. Society is formed for the protection of individuals. In addition to the validity standards discussed above, Blackstone's historical dimension dictates a near absolute standard of legal autonomy. Law wields supremacy over the will of political rulers, whether they are kings or judges. (Blackstone 1838, p. 32).

Regarding the autonomy of law over kings, the most important maxim in English history is "the law makes the king; the king does not make the law." This maxim dates from Henry de Bracton's 1235 treatise The Laws and Customs of the Kingdom of England. “The king must not be under man but under God and under the law, because the law makes the king … there is no king where the will and not the law has dominion.” (De Bracton 1968, p. 33).

Regarding the autonomy of law over judges, Blackstone’s "declaratory theory" prohibits judges from making new law. Judges may only find and declare existing law; they may never make law. Judge-made law unites the power to make and enforce law in one body, and this invites tyranny. The judge should determine the law according to the known laws and customs of the land, not his own private judgment. Judges are not appointed to pronounce new laws. (Blackstone 1838, p. 46, 105).

Nevertheless, since all law is subject to the standard of reason, judges may set aside common law precedents that are contrary to reason as “manifestly absurd or unjust.” Setting unreasonable precedents aside does not create new law. Instead, it vindicates the law from misrepresentation. Unreasonable rules of common law, by definition, are not law. Such precedents are not set aside because they are bad law, but because they are not law. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 46-47).

In applying statutory law, however, the judge may never exercise his discretion to set aside the will of Parliament. The only authority that can declare an act of Parliament void is Parliament itself. The judge must “interpret and obey” its mandates. Judges may never act as miniature legislatures. “In a democracy,” writes Blackstone, “the right of making laws resides in the people at large.” (Blackstone 1838, pp. 27, 33). 

8. Bentham

Legal positivism rejects law's moral and historical dimensions as sources of law or standards of legal validity. H. L. A. Hart is the most important figure in the positivist tradition that begins with Jeremy Bentham and John Austin. Bentham was sixteen when he attended a series of private lectures by Blackstone on the common law. These lectures were later published as Blackstone's Commentaries.

The young Bentham listened with rebel ears. Bentham's anonymous Fragment on Government describes Blackstone’s natural law theory as “theological grimgribber” and an “excursion into the land of fancy.” Bentham describes Blackstone as "the dupe of every prejudice," "the accomplice of every chicanery," "the abettor of every abuse," and "a treasury of vulgar errors." (Bentham 1977, 10).

Bentham’s legal theory has two distinctive features. The first is Bentham's exclusion of law's historical dimension. Bentham’s “imperative” theory of law defines law as (1) the assemblage of signs of a sovereign’s volition, (2) directing the conduct of persons under his power, (3) accompanied by an “expectation” in such persons, that (4) motivates obedience. The sovereign's will provides its own validity standard. Custom is excluded and the ruler wields autonomy over law. (Bentham 1970, p. 1).

Bentham's second distinctive feature is his exclusion of law's moral dimension. Law for Bentham has no necessary conceptual connection with morality. Bentham abandons Blackstone's immutable standards of right and wrong for physical sensations of pleasure and pain: “Nature has placed mankind under the governance of two sovereign masters, pain and pleasure. It is for them alone to point out what we ought to do.” (Bentham 1907, p. 1).

Bentham's Anarchical Fallacies argues that natural laws and natural rights are imaginary. "Natural rights is simple nonsense: natural and imprescriptable rights, nonsense upon stilts." Positive law is the only real law. Only positive law can create real rights, and positive law requires the existence of a sovereign. There can be no rights outside the existence of a sovereign command, and no rights can exist prior to the formation of a government. In sum, the will of the sovereign provides its own standard of legal validity, unrestrained by morality, custom, or the autonomy of law. (Bentham 1843, pp. 501-05).

9. Austin

John Austin's The Province of Jurisprudence Determined defines law's political dimension as the sole source of law and legal validity. Like Bentham's "imperative" theory, Austin's "command" theory of law establishes the political ruler's will as its own standard of legal validity. The sovereign can coerce his will through law without restraint by moral principles, custom, or the autonomy of law.

Austin's "command" theory defines law as (a) commands, (b) backed by threat of sanctions, (c) from a sovereign, (d) to whom people have a habit of obedience. A common criticism of Austin's theory is that the command of a gun-wielding highwayman arguably satisfies Austin's definition of law.

The "command" theory rejects law's historical dimension. Legal customs and principles play no part in law. Law wields no autonomy over the political ruler's will, including the will of judges. In contrast to Blackstone, Austin encourages judges to legislate from the bench. Society cannot function unless judges are free to make new law to correct the negligence and incapacity of legislatures. (Austin 2000, p. 191, 225-31).

Austin's "command" theory rejects law's moral dimension as well. Austin labels Blackstone's natural law validity standard "stark nonsense." God's law is uncertain, and Blackstone's natural law standard preaches anarchy. Austin writes that "the existence of law is one thing; its merit and demerit another. Whether it be or be not is one enquiry; whether it be or be not conformable to an assumed standard, is a different enquiry. A law, which actually exists, is a law, though we happen to dislike it." (Austin 2000, p. 184).

10. Hart

Hart’s 1957 lecture “Positivism and the Separation of Law and Morals” emphasizes three doctrines asserted by Bentham and Austin. The first, which Hart retains, is an emphasis on "the meaning of the distinctive vocabulary of the law." The second doctrine, which Hart retains, is the separation of law and morals. Hart holds law “as it is” distinct from law “as it ought to be.” This distinction rejects moral standards as the test for legal validity. (Hart 1958, pp. 594, 601).

The third doctrine, which Hart rejects, is Austin's command theory of law. Hart rejects Austin’s theory for four reasons. First, Austin fails to recognize that laws generally apply to those who enact them. Second, Austin does not account for laws granting public powers, such as the power to legislate or adjudicate, or for laws granting private powers to create or modify legal relations. Third, Austin fails to account for laws that originate, not from a sovereign, but out of common custom. Fourth, Austin fails to account for the continuity of legislative authority characteristic of a modern legal system. (Hart 1994, p. 70).

Hart replaces Austin's "command" theory with a model of law as the union of primary and secondary social rules. A primary rule is a rule that imposes an obligation or a duty. “[P]rimary rules are concerned with the actions that individuals must or must not do,” such as restrictions on "violence, theft, and deception." A rule imposes an obligation or duty when the demand for conformity is insistent and the social pressure brought to bear upon those who deviate from the rule is great. (Hart 1994, pp. 91, 94).

In order for a system of primary rules to function effectively, Hart states that secondary rules may also be necessary to provide an authoritative statement of all the primary rules. In contrast to primary rules, which impose obligations and duties, secondary rules confer powers to introduce, to change, or to modify a primary rule. These powers may be public or private.  (Hart 1994, pp. 96-97).

There are three types of secondary rules. The first type is the rule of change. This rule allows legislators to make changes in the primary rules if the primary rules are defective or inadequate. The second type is the rule of adjudication. This rule enables courts to resolve disputes regarding the interpretation and application of primary rules. The third type of secondary rule is the rule of recognition. The rule of recognition provides “a rule for conclusive identification of the primary rules of obligation.” It also provides Hart's criterion for legal validity. A rule of law is legally valid if it conforms to the requirements of the rule of recognition. (Hart 1994, pp. 95-98, 103-05).

Hart next turns from defining the validity criteria for individual laws to defining the validity criteria for entire legal systems. System validity is determined by the attitudes of citizens and public officials toward obedience to legal rules. Hart describes two contrasting attitudes, the "external" and "internal" points of view.

The external point of view is the view of a person who feels no obligation to follow the law. He has no sense that it is right to follow the law or wrong not to do so. He rejects law as the standard of conduct for himself or others. The internal point of view, on the other hand, is the view of a person who feels obligated to follow the law. He follows the law because he thinks it is right to do so and wrong not to do so. He feels that he ought, must, and should follow the law. (Hart 1994, pp. 56-57).

The validity of a legal system depends on only two conditions. First, private citizens must generally obey the primary rules of obligation. It is sufficient that citizens take an external point of view toward primary rules. Second, public officials must adopt the rule of recognition specifying the criteria for legal validity as their “public standard of official behavior.” It is a minimum, necessary condition that officials take the internal point of view toward secondary rules. (Hart 1994, pp. 116-17).

Hart's standard of legal validity functions solely in law's political dimension. The will of the political rulers determines the validity of law by their adoption of a rule of recognition. The will of the political rulers determines the validity of the legal system as well. The only necessary condition for a valid legal system is the political rulers' adoption of the internal point of view.

Hart excludes the historical dimension from his standard of legal validity. Hart omits, for example, two of the historical dimension's traditional restraints on the will of the political ruler. The first, emphasized since Aristotle, is the autonomy of law over political rulers. Instead, Hart's political rulers wield autonomy over law by controlling the standard of legal validity. Hart also grants judges autonomy over law by rejecting Blackstone's declaratory theory that judges find but do not make law. If the judge determines the meaning of a legal rule to be "indeterminate or incomplete," the judge “must exercise his discretion and make law for the case instead of merely applying already pre-existing settled law.”

The second historical restraint, emphasized by Locke and Blackstone, is the validity requirement of consent by the governed. Consent is irrelevant to Hart's legal validity. It is sufficient that each member of the population obeys Hart's primary rules “from any motive whatsoever.” "Any motive," as Hart's critics point out, includes terror and force.

Hart also excludes law's moral dimension from his standard of legal validity. Hart accepts "morally iniquitous" laws as legally valid. "There are no necessary conceptual connections between the content of law and morality; and hence morally iniquitous provisions may be valid as legal rules or principles. One aspect of this form of the separation of law from morality is that there can be legal rights and duties which have no moral justification or force whatever." (Hart 1994, p. 268).

11. Radbruch

Gustav Radbruch utilizes legal history to support a validity standard invoking law's moral dimension. Radbruch, once Germany's leading positivist, argues that the positivist separation of law and morality facilitated Hitler's atrocities through legal means. Radbruch argues that German positivism rendered "jurists and the people alike defenseless against arbitrary, cruel, or criminal laws, however extreme they might be. In the end, the positivistic theory equates law with power; there is law only where there is power." (Radbruch 2006b, p. 13). Positivism, in other words, operates only in law's political dimension.

Radbruch blames the positivistic legal thinking that held sway over German jurists for rendering impotent every possible defence against the abuses of National Socialist legislation. Radbruch warns, "We must arm ourselves against the recurrence of an outlaw state like Hitler’s by fundamentally overcoming positivism." Radbruch's solution is a standard of legal validity invoking law's moral dimension. (Radbruch 2006a, p. 8).

This validity standard, known as "Radbruch's Formula," has been applied by German courts. In cases where the discrepancy between justice and statutory law becomes "unbearable," the statute is held void ab initio in the interest of justice. "Radbruch's Formula" holds such statutes void ab initio because they are not truly laws.

Radbruch explains: "Where there is not even an attempt at justice, where equality, the core of justice, is deliberately betrayed in the issuance of positive law, then the statute is not merely ‘flawed law’, it lacks completely the very nature of law. For law, including positive law, cannot be otherwise defined than as a system and an institution whose very meaning is to serve justice. Measured by this standard, whole portions of National Socialist law never attained the dignity of valid law." (Radbruch 2006a, p. 7). Radbruch thus joins Cicero, Aquinas, and Blackstone in concluding that unjust laws are not laws at all.

12. Positivism in American Jurisprudence

Hart's separation of law from morality stimulated significant criticism in the United States. Lon Fuller's The Morality of Law argues that law is subject to an internal morality consisting of eight principles. Laws must be enforced, for example, in a manner consistent with their wording. Legal systems that violate these principles cannot achieve social order. They destroy any moral obligation to obey the law. (Fuller 1964, pp. 33-40).

Ronald Dworkin's "The Model of Rules" argues that Hart's model of law is incomplete. Courts often decide difficult cases according to legal principles that provide moral justifications for case outcomes. One example is the common law maxim that no man should profit from his own wrongful conduct. These legal principles are outside Hart's definition of primary and secondary rules. (Dworkin 1967, pp. 23-24).

Hart's legal positivism nevertheless exerts significant influence in American jurisprudence. Four factors enhance Hart's influence. The first occurred in 1871 when Dean Christopher Langdell of Harvard Law School dropped Blackstone's Commentaries from Harvard's legal curriculum. Blackstone's jurisprudence lost influence as other schools followed.

The second enhancing factor is the erosion of law's moral dimension. Oliver Wendell Holmes, Jr. is a leading figure in this process. Holmes advocated for law without values and identified himself as a skeptic. Holmes defines truth as the majority vote of any nation that is more powerful than all the others. Holmes equates a jurist searching for validity criteria in natural law to the poor devil who must get drunk to satisfy his demand for the superlative. (Holmes 1918, p. 40).

Holmes' "Path of the Law" presents an early form of positivism. Holmes argues for the separation of law and morality. Holmes supports banishing every word of moral significance from the law. He rejects every ethical obligation in contract law. Holmes advocates a "bad man" perspective that looks at law as a bad man who feels no obligation to obey it. This is an early statement of Hart's "external point of view." (Holmes 1997, pp. 991-997).

The third factor enhancing Hart's influence is the erosion of law's historical dimension. Dean Roscoe Pound of Harvard Law School illustrates its erosion. Pound's "Mechanical Jurisprudence" advocates abandoning custom as a source of any law. Pound urged replacing the common law system based on custom with a civil code system based on statutes. (Pound 1908, 605-23).

The fourth factor enhancing Hart's influence is the natural desire of judges to “make” new law. Blackstone’s "declaratory theory" forbids judge-made law, but Hart's "penumbra doctrine" considers it an ordinary and necessary judicial function. One striking example of Hart's influence is Griswold v. Connecticut, 281 U.S. 479 (1965). Griswold applies a penumbra analysis to imply a Constitutional right of privacy while admitting no such right appears in the language of the Constitution. The Supreme Court decided Roe v. Wade, 410 U.S. 113 (1973) based on Griswold's implied right of privacy. The increased willingness of judges to legislate from the bench in 20th and 21st Century American courts is Hart's most significant and controversial legacy in American jurisprudence.

13. A Fresh Approach

Augustine's City of God observes that kingdoms without justice are but great bands of robbers. Robbers become rulers, not by the removal of greed, but by the addition of impunity. (Augustine 1998, p.147-48). Validity standards are the primary means by which societies deny impunity to unjust rulers. Legal validity governs the enforceability of law, and the standard of legal validity controls the ruler's ability to enforce his will through legal coercion.

Standards of legal validity are historically cyclical, and the cycle continued in the United States during the 21st Century. American law initially embraced Blackstone's dual validity standards based on moral principles and legal custom. Centuries of challengers have eroded those standards. Bentham, Austin, Holmes, and Hart eroded Blackstone's moral standard by advocating the separation of law from morality. Pound eroded Blackstone's customary standard by advocating the abandonment of common law. Legal educators dropped Blackstone from their curriculum.

These challengers eroded Blackstone's validity standards, but they did not supplant them. A validity schism divided American jurisprudence. There was no generally accepted validity standard in American law. Academic theorists and legal educators favored Hart for his analytical clarity. Liberal judges favored Hart for increasing their power to make new law. Practitioners and conservative judges favored Blackstone for his emphasis on consent of the governed, autonomy of law, predictability of law, and morally just decisions.

Two irreconcilable bodies of precedent  emerge, one formulated by traditional judges who limit themselves to finding existing law, the other by positivist judges who make new law. As judges increasingly make new law, courts become unpredictable, ex post facto rulings increase, and laws are unevenly applied. Unelected federal judges set aside democratic resolutions of political questions and decide policy issues without public input. Justices devise or limit Constitutional rights according to personal preference to achieve their desired case outcome.

Despite fifty years of debate, the opposing camps remain estranged. Each side utilizes methods its opponent will never accept. Blackstone, for example, formulates his moral precepts in terms of divine law and human reason. This formulation is unpersuasive for two reasons. First, there is no general agreement regarding the terms of divine law, and many reject its very existence. Second, Blackstone adopts inconsistent views of human reason. On one hand, human reason is too "frail, imperfect, and blind" to generate just human laws. On the other hand, human reason is sufficient to generate the precepts of natural law from revelations of divine law.

Legal positivism is unpersuasive as well, insisting on a narrow philosophical method to formulate its standard of legal validity. Hart emphasizes “a purely analytical study of legal concepts, a study of the meaning of the distinctive vocabulary of the law.” (Hart 1958, p. 601). He describes all law as consisting of only two types of rules. Hart's simplistic model of law is inadequate for three reasons.

First, Hart's analysis excludes law's historical and social contexts. Hart restricts his analysis to law's linguistic context. Law is more than linguistics. It encompasses the entirety of the great variety of human affairs. Hart's exclusion of these indispensible contexts commits the "analytical fallacy" described by John Dewey in "Context and Thought" (Dewey 1985, pp. 5-7).

Second, Hart's standard of legal validity ignores the content of law. Hart only considers the pedigree of the law's creation. Hart consequently accepts the validity of “morally iniquitous laws” whose content possesses “no moral justification or force whatsoever.” (Hart 1994, p. 268).

Hart ignores the grave consequences of enforcing "morally iniquitous" laws. For example, Hart validates legal systems if two conditions are met. First, citizens may take an external point of view toward primary rules. Obedience "from any motive whatsoever" is sufficient, permitting coercion through terror. Second, officials must take an internal point of view toward secondary rules. Objectively considered, the legal systems utilized by Stalin and Hitler satisfy both conditions.

Third, Hart's model of law as rules is incomplete. Something important is missing from a legal philosophy that validates the Soviet and Nazi legal systems. That missing element is justice, and justice is a moral concept. As Ronald Dworkin explains, courts usually decide difficult cases according to legal principles that provide moral justifications for case outcomes. Hart's model of rules excludes these principles. (Dworkin 1967, pp. 23-24).

Hart showed how to separate law from morality, but history showed why societies should not do so. Critics contend that a fresh approach is needed.

Neither Blackstone nor Hart assign legal history a significant role in formulating their validity standards. No major jurist since Cicero has done so. Nevertheless, a historical formulation of legal validity can avoid the problems described above. Unlike Blackstone, legal history does not require belief in a divine lawgiver, and unlike Hart, legal history does not ignore the content of law.

Legal history provides a long record of legal experimentation. A scientific approach identifies three principles that recur in just and stable legal systems. Legal systems without these principles repeatedly become arbitrary, unjust, and unstable.

The first principle is the principle of reason, which addresses the validity of law's content. The principle of reason recognizes that every subject is a rational creature with a free will. To be stable, the legal system must treat its subjects as ends in themselves, and not as a mere means to another end. The legal system must also permit rational individuals to orient their own behavior in order to achieve a society based on ordered liberty. Procedural due process protects against the punishment of the innocent and the tyranny of the majority. Substantive due process enables laws to provide dependable guideposts to individuals in orienting their behavior.

The second principle is the principle of consent, which addresses the validity of law's creation. This principle provides that the legitimacy of law derives from the consent of those subject to its power. Common law custom, the doctrine of stare decisis, and legislation sanctioned by the subjects' legitimate representatives are all evidence of consent.

The third principle is the principle of autonomy, which addresses both the content and the creation of law. Laws must wield supremacy over political rulers. The ruler must be under the same laws as his subjects, and the laws must not be subject to arbitrary change to reflect the ruler's will. To paraphrase de Bracton, the law must make the king. The king must not make the law. To paraphrase Aristotle, rightly constituted laws must be the final sovereign.

These principles operate in law's moral and historical dimensions to restrain the ruler's ability to enforce his will through legal coercion. Legal systems become unjust and unstable in the absence of such restraints. They project the power of the political ruler, but they are not valid legal systems. The history of the Western legal tradition is the history of revolutions against such systems. (Berman 1983).

14. References and Further Reading

  • Aquinas, Thomas. Treatise on Law (Summa Theologica, Questions 90-07). Ed. Ralph McInerny. Washington: Regnery, 1996. Print.
  • Aristotle. The Athenian Constitution. Trans. Sir Frederic G. Kenyon. Seaside, OR: Merchant, 2009. Print.
  • Aristotlte. Ethica Nichomachea. Trans. W.D. Ross. New York: Oxford UP, 2009. Print.
  • Aristotlte. Metaphysics. Trans. Joe Sachs. Santa Fe: Green Lion, 2002. Print.
  • Aristotlte. Physics. Trans. Robin Waterfield. Ed. David Bostock. Oxford: Oxford UP, 1996. Print.
  • Aristotlte. The Politics of Aristotle. Trans. Ernest Barker. Oxford: Oxford UP, 1946. Print.
  • Aristotlte. Rhetoric. Ed. W.D. Ross. Trans. W. Rhys Roberts. New York: Cosimo, 2010. Print.
  • Augustine. The City of God against the Pagans. Trans. R.W. Dyson. Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1998. Print.
  • Austin, John. The Province of Jurisprudence Determined. Amherst, NY: Prometheus, 2000. Print.
  • Bentham, Jeremy. “Anarchical Fallacies; Being an Examination of the Declarations of Rights Issued During the French Revolution.” The Works of Jeremy Bentham. 11 vols. Edinburgh: William Tait, 1838-43. Print.
  • Bentham, Jeremy. A Comment on the Commentaries and A Fragment on Government. Ed. J.H. Burns and H.L.A. Hart. London: Athlone, 1977. Print.
  • Bentham, Jeremy. An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation. Oxford: Clarendon, 1907. Print.
  • Bentham, Jeremy. Of Laws in General. Ed. H.L.A. Hart. London: Athlone, 1970. Print.
  • Berman, Harold J. Law and Revolution: The Formation of the Western Legal Tradition. Cambridge: Harvard UP, 1983. Print.
  • Berman, Harold J. "Toward an Integrative Jurisprudence: Politics, Morality, History." 76 (4) California Law Review (1988): 779-801. Print.
  • Blackstone, Sir William. Commentaries on the Laws of England. Vol. 1. New York: W.E. Dean, 1838. Print.
  • Cicero, De Officis (On Duties). Ed. M.T. Griffin and E.M. Atkins. Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1991. Print.
  • Cicero, De Re Publica (On the Republic) and De Legibus (On the Laws). Trans. C.W. Keyes. Ed. Jeffrey Henderson. Bury St. Edmonds, UK: St. Edmondsbury, 2000. Print.
  • De Bracton, Henry. De Legibus et Consuetudinibus Angliae (On the Laws and Customs of England). Ed. George E. Woodbine. Trans. Samuel E. Thorne. 4 vols. Cambridge: Harvard UP, 1968. Print.
  • Dewey, John. “Context and Thought.” The Later Works of John Dewey. Ed. Jo Ann Boydston. Vol. 6. Carbondale, IL: S. Illinois UP, 1985. Print.
  • Dworkin, Ronald. “The Model of Rules.” U. Chi. L. Rev. 35 (1) (1967): 14-46. Print.
  • Fuller, Lon L. The Morality of Law. New Haven: Yale UP, 1964. Print.
  • Hamilton, Alexander, John Jay, and James Madison. “Federalist No. 63.” The Federalist Papers. Ed. Ernest O'Dell. Sundown, TX: CreateSpace, 2010. Print.
  • Hart, H. L. A. The Concept of Law. 2nd ed. Oxford: Clarendon, 1994. Print.
  • Hart, H. L. A. “Positivism and the Separation of Law and Morals.” Harv. L Rev. 71 (4) (1958): 593–629. Print.
  • Hesiod. Theogony, Works and Days, Shield. Trans. Apostolos N. Athanassakis. 2nd ed. Baltimore: Johns Hopkins Press, 2004. Print.
  • Holmes, Oliver Wendell, Jr. “Natural Law.” Harv. L. Rev. 32 (1) (1918): 40-44. Print.
  • Holmes, Oliver Wendell, Jr. “The Path of the Law.” Harv. L. Rev. 110 (5) (1997): 991-1009. Print.
  • Justinian. Corpus Juris Civilis, The Civil Law. Trans. S.P. Scott. 17 vols. Cincinnati: Central Trust, 1932. Print.
  • Plato. Crito. The Collected Dialogues of Plato, including the Letters. Trans. Lane Cooper. Ed. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. Princeton: Princeton UP, 1961. Print.
  • Plato. Protagoras. The Collected Dialogues of Plato, including the Letters. Trans. Lane Cooper. Ed. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. Princeton: Princeton UP, 1961. Print.
  • Plato. Gorgias. The Collected Dialogues of Plato, including the Letters. Trans. Lane Cooper. Ed. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. Princeton: Princeton UP, 1961. Print.
  • Plato. "Letter VII." The Collected Dialogues of Plato, including the Letters. Trans. Lane Cooper. Ed. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. Princeton: Princeton UP, 1961. Print.
  • Plato. Laws. The Collected Dialogues of Plato, including the Letters. Trans. Lane Cooper. Ed. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. Princeton: Princeton UP, 1961. Print.
  • Plato. Theaetetus. The Collected Dialogues of Plato, including the Letters. Trans. Lane Cooper. Ed. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. Princeton: Princeton UP, 1961. Print.
  • Plato. The Republic. The Collected Dialogues of Plato, including the Letters. Trans. Lane Cooper. Ed. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. Princeton: Princeton UP, 1961. Print.
  • Plutarch. “Themistocles.” Plutarch's Lives. Trans. Bernadotte Perrin. Cambridge: Harvard UP, 1914. Print.
  • Pound, Roscoe. “Mechanical Jurisprudence.” Colum. L. Rev. 8 (3) (1908): 605-623. Print.
  • Radbruch, Gustav. “Five Minutes of Legal Philosophy.” Trans. Bonnie Litschewski Paulson and Stanley L. Paulson. Oxford J. Legal Stud. 26 (1) (2006b): 13-15. Print.
  • Radbruch, Gustav. “Statutory Lawlessness and Supra-Statutory Law.” Trans. Bonnie Litschewski Paulson and Stanley L. Paulson. Oxford J. Legal Stud. 26 (1) (2006a): 1-11. Print.
  • Xenophon. Socrates' Defence. Ed. Robin Waterfield. Trans. Hugh Tredennick and Robin Waterfield. New York: Penguin, 1990. Print.


Author Information

John O. Tyler, Jr.
Houston Baptist University
U. S. A.

Act and Rule Utilitarianism

Utilitarianism is one of the best known and most influential moral theories. Like other forms of consequentialism, its core idea is that whether actions are morally right or wrong depends on their effects. More specifically, the only effects of actions that are relevant are the good and bad results that they produce. A key point in this article concerns the distinction between individual actions and types of actions. Act utilitarians focus on the effects of individual actions (such as John Wilkes Booth’s assassination of Abraham Lincoln) while rule utilitarians focus on the effects of types of actions (such as killing or stealing).

Utilitarians believe that the purpose of morality is to make life better by increasing the amount of good things (such as pleasure and happiness) in the world and decreasing the amount of bad things (such as pain and unhappiness). They reject moral codes or systems that consist of commands or taboos that are based on customs, traditions, or orders given by leaders or supernatural beings. Instead, utilitarians think that what makes a morality be true or justifiable is its positive contribution to human (and perhaps non-human) beings.

The most important classical utilitarians are Jeremy Bentham (1748-1832) and John Stuart Mill (1806-1873). Bentham and Mill were both important theorists and social reformers. Their theory has had a major impact both on philosophical work in moral theory and on approaches to economic, political, and social policy. Although utilitarianism has always had many critics,  there are many 21st century thinkers that support it.

The task of determining whether utilitarianism is the correct moral theory is complicated because there are different versions of the theory, and its supporters disagree about which version is correct. This article focuses on perhaps the most important dividing line among utilitarians, the clash between act utilitarianism and rule utilitarianism. After a brief overall explanation of utilitarianism, the article explains both act utilitarianism and rule utilitarianism, the main differences between them, and some of the key arguments for and against each view.

Table of Contents

  1. Utilitarianism: Overall View
    1. What is Good?
    2. Whose Well-being?
      1. Individual Self-interest
      2. Groups
      3. Everyone Affected
    3. Actual Consequences or Foreseeable Consequences?
  2. How Act Utilitarianism and Rule Utilitarianism Differ
  3. Act Utilitarianism: Pros and Cons
    1. Arguments for Act Utilitarianism
      1. Why Act utilitarianism Maximizes Utility
      2. Why Act Utilitarianism is Better than Traditional, Rule-based Moralities
      3. Why Act Utilitarianism Makes Moral Judgments Objectively True
    2. Arguments against Act Utilitarianism
      1. The “Wrong Answers” Objection
      2. The “Undermining Trust” Objection
      3. Partiality and the “Too Demanding” Objection
    3. Possible Responses to Criticisms of Act Utilitarianism
  4. Rule Utilitarianism: Pros and Cons
    1. Arguments for Rule Utilitarianism
      1. Why Rule Utilitarianism Maximizes Utility
      2. Rule Utilitarianism Avoids the Criticisms of Act Utilitarianism
        1. Judges, Doctors, and Promise-makers
        2. Maintaining vs. Undermining Trust
        3. Impartiality and the Problem of Over-Demandingness
    2. Arguments against Rule Utilitarianism
      1. The “Rule Worship” Objection
      2. The “Collapses into Act Utilitarianism” Objection
      3. Wrong Answers and Crude Concepts
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Classic Works
    2. More Recent Utilitarians
    3. Overviews
    4. J. S. Mill and Utilitarian Moral Theory
    5. Critics of Utilitarianism
    6. Collections of Essays

1. Utilitarianism: Overall View

Utilitarianism is a philosophical view or theory about how we should evaluate a wide range of things that involve choices that people face. Among the things that can be evaluated are actions, laws, policies, character traits, and moral codes. Utilitarianism is a form of consequentialism because it rests on the idea that it is the consequences or results of actions, laws, policies, etc. that determine whether they are good or bad, right or wrong. In general, whatever is being evaluated, we ought to choose the one that will produce the best overall results. In the language of utilitarians, we should choose the option that “maximizes utility,” i.e. that action or policy that produces the largest amount of good.

Utilitarianism appears to be a simple theory because it consists of only one evaluative principle: Do what produces the best consequences. In fact, however, the theory is complex because we cannot understand that single principle unless we know (at least) three things: a) what things are good and bad;  b) whose good (i.e. which individuals or groups) we should aim to maximize; and c) whether actions, policies, etc. are made right or wrong by their actual consequences (the results that our actions actually produce) or by their foreseeable consequences (the results that we predict will occur based on the evidence that we have).

a. What is Good?

Jeremy Bentham answered this question by adopting the view called hedonism. According to hedonism, the only thing that is good in itself is pleasure (or happiness). Hedonists do not deny that many different kinds of things can be good, including food, friends, freedom, and many other things, but hedonists see these as “instrumental” goods that are valuable only because they play a causal role in producing pleasure or happiness. Pleasure and happiness, however, are “intrinsic” goods, meaning that they are good in themselves and not because they produce some further valuable thing. Likewise, on the negative side, a lack of food, friends, or freedom is instrumentally bad because it produces pain, suffering, and unhappiness; but pain, suffering and unhappiness are intrinsically bad, i.e. bad in themselves and not because they produce some further bad thing.

Many thinkers have rejected hedonism because pleasure and pain are sensations that we feel, claiming that many important goods are not types of feelings. Being healthy or honest or having knowledge, for example, are thought by some people to be intrinsic goods that are not types of feelings. (People who think there are many such goods are called pluralists or“objective list” theorists.) Other thinkers see desires or preferences as the basis of value; whatever a person desires is valuable to that person. If desires conflict, then the things most strongly preferred are identified as good.

In this article, the term “well-being” will generally be used to identify what utilitarians see as good or valuable in itself. All utilitarians agree that things are valuable because they tend to produce well-being or diminish ill-being, but this idea is understood differently by hedonists, objective list theorists, and preference/desire theorists. This debate will not be further discussed in this article.

b. Whose Well-being?

Utilitarian reasoning can be used for many different purposes. It can be used both for moral reasoning and for any type of rational decision-making. In addition to applying in different contexts, it can also be used for deliberations about the interests of different persons and groups.

i. Individual Self-interest

(See egoism.) When individuals are deciding what to do for themselves alone, they consider only their own utility. For example, if you are choosing ice cream for yourself, the utilitarian view is that you should choose the flavor that will give you the most pleasure. If you enjoy chocolate but hate vanilla, you should choose chocolate for the pleasure it will bring and avoid vanilla because it will bring displeasure. In addition, if you enjoy both chocolate and strawberry, you should predict which flavor will bring you more pleasure and choose whichever one will do that.

In this case, because utilitarian reasoning is being applied to a decision about which action is best for an individual person, it focuses only on how the various possible choices will affect this single person’s interest and does not consider the interests of other people.

ii. Groups

People often need to judge what is best not only for themselves or other individuals but alsowhat is best for groups, such as friends, families, religious groups, one’s country, etc. Because Bentham and other utilitarians were interested in political groups and public policies, they often focused on discovering which actions and policies would maximize the well-being of the relevant group. Their method for determining the well-being of a group involved adding up the benefits and losses that members of the group would experience as a result of adopting one action or policy. The well-being of the group is simply the sum total of the interests of the all of its members.

To illustrate this method, suppose that you are buying ice cream for a party that ten people will attend. Your only flavor options are chocolate and vanilla, and some of the people attending like chocolate while others like vanilla. As a utilitarian, you should choose the flavor that will result in the most pleasure for the group as a whole. If seven like chocolate and three like vanilla and if all of them get the same amount of pleasure from the flavor they like, then you should choose chocolate. This will yield what Bentham, in a famous phrase, called “the greatest happiness for the greatest number.”

An important point in this case is that you should choose chocolate even if you are one of the three people who enjoy vanilla more than chocolate. The utilitarian method requires you to count everyone’s interests equally. You may not weigh some people’s interests—including your own—more heavily than others. Similarly, if a government is choosing a policy, it should give equal consideration to the well-being of all members of the society.

iii. Everyone Affected

While there are circumstances in which the utilitarian analysis focuses on the interests of specific individuals or groups, the utilitarian moral theory requires that moral judgments be based on what Peter Singer calls the “equal consideration of interests.” Utilitarianism moral theory then, includes the important idea that when we calculate the utility of actions, laws, or policies, we must do so from an impartial perspective and not from a “partialist” perspective that favors ourselves, our friends, or others we especially care about. Bentham is often cited as the source of a famous utilitarian axiom: “every man to count for one, nobody for more than one.”

If this impartial perspective is seen as necessary for a utilitarian morality, then both self-interest and partiality to specific groups will be rejected as deviations from utilitarian morality. For example, so-called “ethical egoism,” which says that morality requires people to promote their own interest, would be rejected either as a false morality or as not a morality at all. While a utilitarian method for determining what people’s interests are may show that it is rational for people to maximize their own well-being or the well-being of groups that they favor, utilitarian morality would reject this as a criterion for determining what is morally right or wrong.

c. Actual Consequences or Foreseeable Consequences?

Utilitarians disagree about whether judgments of right and wrong should be based on the actual consequences of actions or their foreseeable consequences. This issue arises when the actual effects of actions differ from what we expected. J. J. C. Smart (49) explains this difference by imagining the action of a person who, in 1938,saves someone from drowning. While we generally regard saving a drowning person as the right thing to do and praise people for such actions, in Smart’s imagined example, the person saved from drowning turns out to be Adolph Hitler. Had Hitler drowned, millions of other people might have been saved from suffering and death between 1938 and 1945. If utilitarianism evaluates the rescuer’s action based on its actual consequences, then the rescuer did the wrong thing. If, however, utilitarians judge the rescuer’s action by its foreseeable consequences (i.e. the ones the rescuer could reasonably predict), then the rescuer—who could not predict the negative effects of saving the person from drowning—did the right thing.

One reason for adopting foreseeable consequence utilitarianism is that it seems unfair to say that the rescuer acted wrongly because the rescuer could not foresee the future bad effects of saving the drowning person. In response, actual consequence utilitarians reply that there is a difference between evaluating an action and evaluating the person who did the action. In their view, while the rescuer’s action was wrong, it would be a mistake to blame or criticize the rescuer because the bad results of his act were unforeseeable. They stress the difference between evaluating actions and evaluating the people who perform them.

Foreseeable consequence utilitarians accept the distinction between evaluating actions and evaluating the people who carry them out, but they see no reason to make the moral rightness or wrongness of actions depend on facts that might be unknowable. For them, what is right or wrong for a person to do depends on what is knowable by a person at a time. For this reason, they claim that the person who rescued Hitler did the right thing, even though the actual consequences were unfortunate.

Another way to describe the actual vs. foreseeable consequence dispute is to contrast two thoughts. One (the actual consequence view) says that to act rightly is to do whatever produces the best consequences. The second view says that a person acts rightly by doing the action that has the highest level of “expected utility.” The expected utility is a combination of the good (or bad) effects that one predicts will result from an action and the probability of those effects occurring. In the case of the rescuer, the expected positive utility is high because the probability that saving a drowning person will lead to the deaths of millions of other people is extremely low, and thus can be ignored in deliberations about whether to save the drowning person.

What this shows is that actual consequence and foreseeable consequence utilitarians have different views about the nature of utilitarian theory. Foreseeable consequence utilitarians understand the theory as a decision-making procedure while actual consequence utilitarians understand it as a criterion of right and wrong. Foreseeable consequence utilitarians claim that the action with the highest expected utility is both the best thing to do based on current evidence and the right action. Actual consequence utilitarians might agree that the option with the highest expected utility is the best thing to do but they claim that it could still turn out to be the wrong action. This would occur if unforeseen bad consequences reveal that the option chosen did not have the best results and thus was the wrong thing to do.

2. How Act Utilitarianism and Rule Utilitarianism Differ

Both act utilitarians and rule utilitarians agree that our overall aim in evaluating actions should be to create the best results possible, but they differ about how to do that.

Act utilitarians believe that whenever we are deciding what to do, we should perform the action that will create the greatest net utility. In their view, the principle of utility—do whatever will produce the best overall results—should be applied on a case by case basis. The right action in any situation is the one that yields more utility (i.e. creates more well-being) than other available actions.

Rule utilitarians adopt a two part view that stresses the importance of moral rules. According to rule utilitarians, a) a specific action is morally justified if it conforms to a justified moral rule; and b) a moral rule is justified if its inclusion into our moral code would create more utility than other possible rules (or no rule at all). According to this perspective, we should judge the morality of individual actions by reference to general moral rules, and we should judge particular moral rules by seeing whether their acceptance into our moral code would produce more well-being than other possible rules.

The key difference between act and rule utilitarianism is that act utilitarians apply the utilitarian principle directly to the evaluation of individual actions while rule utilitarians apply the utilitarian principle directly to the evaluation of rules and then evaluate individual actions by seeing if they obey or disobey those rules whose acceptance will produce the most utility.

The contrast between act and rule utilitarianism, though previously noted by some philosophers, was not sharply drawn until the late 1950s when Richard Brandt introduced this terminology. (Other terms that have been used to make this contrast are “direct” and “extreme” for act utilitarianism, and “indirect” and “restricted” for rule utilitarianism.) Because the contrast had not been sharply drawn, earlier utilitarians like Bentham and Mill sometimes apply the principle of utility to actions and sometimes apply it to the choice of rules for evaluating actions. This has led to scholarly debates about whether the classical utilitarians supported act utilitarians or rule utilitarians or some combination of these views. One indication that Mill accepted rule utilitarianism is his claim that direct appeal to the principle of utility is made only when “secondary principles” (i.e. rules) conflict with one another. In such cases, the “maximize utility” principle is used to resolve the conflict and determine the right action to take. [Mill, Utilitarianism, Chapter 2]

3. Act Utilitarianism: Pros and Cons

Act utilitarianism is often seen as the most natural interpretation of the utilitarian ideal. If our aim is always to produce the best results, it seems plausible to think that in each case of deciding what is the right thing to do, we should consider the available options (i.e. what actions could be performed), predict their outcomes, and approve of the action that will produce the most good.

a. Arguments for Act Utilitarianism

i. Why Act utilitarianism Maximizes Utility

If every action that we carry out yields more utility than any other action available to us, then the total utility of all our actions will be the highest possible level of utility that we could bring about. In other words, we can maximize the overall utility that is within our power to bring about by maximizing the utility of each individual action that we perform. If we sometimes choose actions that produce less utility than is possible, the total utility of our actions will be less than the amount of goodness that we could have produced. For that reason, act utilitarians argue, we should apply the utilitarian principle to individual acts and not to classes of similar actions.

ii. Why Act Utilitarianism is Better than Traditional, Rule-based Moralities

Traditional moral codes often consist of sets of rules regarding types of actions. The Ten Commandments, for example, focus on types of actions, telling us not to kill, steal, bear false witness, commit adultery, or covet the things that belong to others. Although the Biblical sources permit exceptions to these rules (such as killing in self-defense and punishing people for their sins), the form of the commandments is absolute. They tell us “thou shalt not do x” rather than saying “thou shalt not do x except in circumstances a, b, or c.”

In fact, both customary and philosophical moral codes often seem to consist of absolute rules. The philosopher Immanuel Kant is famous for the view that lying is always wrong, even in cases where one might save a life by lying. According to Kant, if A is trying to murder B and A asks you where B is, it would be wrong for you to lie to A, even if lying would save B’s life (Kant).

Act utilitarians reject rigid rule-based moralities that identify whole classes of actions as right or wrong. They argue that it is a mistake to treat whole classes of actions as right or wrong because the effects of actions differ when they are done in different contexts and morality must focus on the likely effects of individual actions. It is these effects that determine whether they are right or wrong in specific cases. Act utilitarians acknowledge that it may be useful to have moral rules that are “rules of thumb”—i.e., rules that describe what is generally right or wrong, but they insist that whenever people can do more good by violating a rule rather than obeying it, they should violate the rule. They see no reason to obey a rule when more well-being can be achieved by violating it.

iii. Why Act Utilitarianism Makes Moral Judgments Objectively True

One advantage of act utilitarianism is that it shows how moral questions can have objectively true answers. Often, people believe that morality is subjective and depends only on people’s desires or sincere beliefs. Act utilitarianism, however, provides a method for showing which moral beliefs are true and which are false.

Once we embrace the act utilitarian perspective, then every decision about how we should act will depend on the actual or foreseeable consequences of the available options. If we can predict the amount of utility/good results that will be produced by various possible actions, then we can know which ones are right or wrong.

Although some people doubt that we can measure amounts of well-being, we in fact do this all the time. If two people are suffering and we have enough medication for only one, we can often tell that one person is experiencing mild discomfort while the other is in severe pain. Based on this judgment, we will be confident that we can do more good by giving the medication to the person suffering extreme pain. Although this case is very simple, it shows that we can have objectively true answers to questions about what actions are morally right or wrong.

Jeremy Bentham provided a model for this type of decision making in his description of a “hedonic calculus,” which was meant to show what factors should be used to determine amounts of pleasure and happiness, pain and suffering. Using this information, Bentham thought, would allow for making correct judgments both in individual cases and in choices about government actions and policies.

b. Arguments against Act Utilitarianism

i. The “Wrong Answers” Objection

The most common argument against act utilitarianism is that it gives the wrong answers to moral questions. Critics say that it permits various actions that everyone knows are morally wrong. The following cases are among the commonly cited examples:

  • If a judge can prevent riots that will cause many deaths only by convicting an innocent person of a crime and imposing a severe punishment on that person, act utilitarianism implies that the judge should convict and punish the innocent person. (See Rawls and also Punishment.)
  • If a doctor can save five people from death by killing one healthy person and using that person’s organs for life-saving transplants, then act utilitarianism implies that the doctor should kill the one person to save five.
  • If a person makes a promise but breaking the promise will allow that person to perform an action that creates just slightly more well-being than keeping the promise will, then act utilitarianism implies that the promise should be broken. (See Ross)

The general form of each of these arguments is the same. In each case, act utilitarianism implies that a certain act is morally permissible or required. Yet, each of the judgments that flow from act utilitarianism conflicts with widespread, deeply held moral beliefs. Because act utilitarianism approves of actions that most people see as obviously morally wrong, we can know that it is a false moral theory.

ii. The “Undermining Trust” Objection

Although act utilitarians criticize traditional moral rules for being too rigid, critics charge that utilitarians ignore the fact that this alleged rigidity is the basis for trust between people. If, in cases like the ones described above, judges, doctors, and promise-makers are committed to doing whatever maximizes well-being, then no one will be able to trust that judges will act according to the law, that doctors will not use the organs of one patient to benefit others, and that promise-makers will keep their promises. More generally, if everyone believed that morality permitted lying, promise-breaking, cheating, and violating the law whenever doing so led to good results, then no one could trust other people to obey these rules. As a result, in an act utilitarian society, we could not believe what others say, could not rely on them to keep promises, and in general could not count on people to act in accord with important moral rules. As a result, people’s behavior would lack the kind of predictability and consistency that are required to sustain trust and social stability.

iii. Partiality and the “Too Demanding” Objection

Critics also attack utilitarianism’s commitment to impartiality and the equal consideration of interests. An implication of this commitment is that whenever people want to buy something for themselves or for a friend or family member, they must first determine whether they could create more well-being by donating their money to help unknown strangers who are seriously ill or impoverished. If more good can be done by helping strangers than by purchasing things for oneself or people one personally cares about, then act utilitarianism requires us to use the money to help strangers in need. Why? Because act utilitarianism requires impartiality and the equal consideration of all people’s needs and interests.

Almost everyone, however, believes that we have special moral duties to people who are near and dear to us. As a result, most people would reject the notion that morality requires us to treat people we love and care about no differently from people who are perfect strangers as absurd.

This issue is not merely a hypothetical case. In a famous article, Peter Singer defends the view that people living in affluent countries should not purchase luxury items for themselves when the world is full of impoverished people. According to Singer, a person should keep donating money to people in dire need until the donor reaches the point where giving to others generates more harm to the donor than the good that is generated for the recipients.

Critics claim that the argument for using our money to help impoverished strangers rather than benefiting ourselves and people we care about only proves one thing—that act utilitarianism is false. There are two reasons that show why it is false. First, it fails to recognize the moral legitimacy of giving special preferences to ourselves and people that we know and care about. Second, since pretty much everyone is strongly motivated to act on behalf of themselves and people they care about, a morality that forbids this and requires equal consideration of strangers is much too demanding. It asks more than can reasonably be expected of people.

c. Possible Responses to Criticisms of Act Utilitarianism

There are two ways in which act utilitarians can defend their view against these criticisms. First, they can argue that critics misinterpret act utilitarianism and mistakenly claim that it is committed to supporting the wrong answer to various moral questions. This reply agrees that the “wrong answers” are genuinely wrong, but it denies that the “wrong answers” maximize utility. Because they do not maximize utility, these wrong answers would not be supported by act utilitarians and therefore, do nothing to weaken their theory.

Second, act utilitarians can take a different approach by agreeing with the critics that act utilitarianism supports the views that critics label “wrong answers.”  Act utilitarians may reply that all this shows is that the views supported by act utilitarianism conflict with common sense morality. Unless critics can prove that common sense moral beliefs are correct the criticisms have no force. Act utilitarians claim that their theory provides good reasons to reject many ordinary moral claims and to replace them with moral views that are based on the effects of actions.

People who are convinced by the criticisms of act utilitarianism may decide to reject utilitarianism entirely and adopt a different type of moral theory. This judgment, however, would be sound only if act utilitarianism were the only type of utilitarian theory. If there are other versions of utilitarianism that do not have act utilitarianism’s flaws, then one may accept the criticisms of act utilitarianism without forsaking utilitarianism entirely. This is what defenders of rule utilitarianism claim. They argue that rule utilitarianism retains the virtues of a utilitarian moral theory but without the flaws of the act utilitarian version.

4. Rule Utilitarianism: Pros and Cons

Unlike act utilitarians, who try to maximize overall utility by applying the utilitarian principle to individual acts, rule utilitarians believe that we can maximize utility only by setting up a moral code that contains rules. The correct moral rules are those whose inclusion in our moral code will produce better results (more well-being) than other possible rules. Once we determine what these rules are, we can then judge individual actions by seeing if they conform to these rules. The principle of utility, then, is used to evaluate rules and is not applied directly to individual actions. Once the rules are determined, compliance with these rules provides the standard for evaluating individual actions.

a. Arguments for Rule Utilitarianism

i. Why Rule Utilitarianism Maximizes Utility

Rule utilitarianism sounds paradoxical. It says that we can produce more beneficial results by following rules than by always performing individual actions whose results are as beneficial as possible. This suggests that we should not always perform individual actions that maximize utility. How could this be something that a utilitarian would support?

In spite of this paradox, rule utilitarianism possesses its own appeal, and its focus on moral rules can sound quite plausible. The rule utilitarian approach to morality can be illustrated by considering the rules of the road. If we are devising a code for drivers, we can adopt either open-ended rules like “drive safely” or specific rules like “stop at red lights,” "do not travel more than 30 miles per hour in residential areas,” “do not drive when drunk," etc. The rule “drive safely”, like the act utilitarian principle, is a very general rule that leaves it up to individuals to determine what the best way to drive in each circumstance is.  More specific rules that require stopping at lights, forbid going faster than 30 miles per hour, or prohibit driving while drunk do not give drivers the discretion to judge what is best to do. They simply tell drivers what to do or not do while driving.

The reason why a more rigid rule-based system leads to greater overall utility is that people are notoriously bad at judging what is the best thing to do when they are driving a car. Having specific rules maximizes utility by limiting drivers’ discretionary judgments and thereby decreasing the ways in which drivers may endanger themselves and others.

A rule utilitarian can illustrate this by considering the difference between stop signs and yield signs. Stop signs forbid drivers to go through an intersection without stopping, even if the driver sees that there are no cars approaching and thus no danger in not stopping. A yield sign permits drivers to go through without stopping unless they judge that approaching cars make it dangerous to drive through the intersection. The key difference between these signs is the amount of discretion that they give to the driver.

The stop sign is like the rule utilitarian approach. It tells drivers to stop and does not allow them to calculate whether it would be better to stop or not. The yield sign is like act utilitarianism. It permits drivers to decide whether there is a need to stop. Act utilitarians see the stop sign as too rigid because it requires drivers to stop even when nothing bad will be prevented. The result, they say, is a loss of utility each time a driver stops at a stop sign when there is no danger from oncoming cars.

Rule utilitarians will reply that they would reject the stop sign method a) if people could be counted on to drive carefully and b) if traffic accidents only caused limited amounts of harm. But, they say, neither of these is true. Because people often drive too fast and are inattentive while driving (because they are, for example, talking, texting, listening to music, or tired), we cannot count on people to make good utilitarian judgments about how to drive safely. In addition, the costs (i.e. the disutility) of accidents can be very high. Accident victims (including drivers) may be killed, injured, or disabled for life. For these reasons, rule utilitarians support the use of stop signs and other non-discretionary rules under some circumstances. Overall these rules generate greater utility because they prevent more disutility (from accidents) than they create (from “unnecessary” stops).

Rule utilitarians generalize from this type of case and claim that our knowledge of human behavior shows that there are many cases in which general rules or practices are more likely to promote good effects than simply telling people to do whatever they think is best in each individual case.

This does not mean that rule utilitarians always support rigid rules without exceptions. Some rules can identify types of situations in which the prohibition is over-ridden. In emergency medical situations, for example, a driver may justifiably go through a red light or stop sign based on the driver’s own assessment that a) this can be done safely and b) the situation is one in which even a short delay might cause dire harms. So the correct rule need not be “never go through a stop sign” but rather can be something like “never go through a stop sign except in cases that have properties a and b.” In addition, there will remain many things about driving or other behavior that can be left to people’s discretion. The rules of the road do not tell drivers when to drive or what their destination should be for example.

Overall then, rule utilitarian can allow departures from rules and will leave many choices up to individuals. In such cases, people may act in the manner that looks like the approach supported by act utilitarians. Nonetheless, these discretionary actions are permitted because having a rule in these cases does not maximize utility or because the best rule may impose some constraints on how people act while still permitting a lot of discretion in deciding what to do.

ii. Rule Utilitarianism Avoids the Criticisms of Act Utilitarianism

As discussed earlier, critics of act utilitarianism raise three strong objections against it. According to these critics, act utilitarianism a) approves of actions that are clearly wrong; b) undermines trust among people, and c) is too demanding because it requires people to make excessive levels of sacrifice. Rule utilitarians tend to agree with these criticisms of act utilitarianism and try to explain why rule utilitarianism is not open to any of these objections.

1. Judges, Doctors, and Promise-makers

Critics of act utilitarianism claim that it allows judges to sentence innocent people to severe punishments when doing so will maximize utility, allows doctors to kill healthy patients if by doing so, they can use the organs of one person to save more lives, and allows people to break promises if that will create slightly more benefits than keeping the promise.

Rule utilitarians say that they can avoid all these charges because they do not evaluate individual actions separately but instead support rules whose acceptance maximizes utility. To see the difference that their focus on rules makes, consider which rule would maximize utility: a) a rule that allows medical doctors to kill healthy patients so that they can use their organs for transplants that will save a larger number of patients who would die without these organs; or b) a rule that forbids doctors to remove the organs of healthy patients in order to benefit other patients.

Although more good may be done by killing the healthy patient in an individual case, it is unlikely that more overall good will be done by having a rule that allows this practice. If a rule were adopted that allows doctors to kill healthy patients when this will save more lives, the result would be that many people would not go to doctors at all. A rule utilitarian evaluation will take account of the fact that the benefits of medical treatment would be greatly diminished because people would no longer trust doctors. People who seek medical treatment must have a high degree of trust in doctors. If they had to worry that doctors might use their organs to help other patients, they would not, for example, allow doctors to anesthetize them for surgery because the resulting loss of consciousness would make them completely vulnerable and unable to defend themselves. Thus, the rule that allows doctors to kill one patient to save five would not maximize utility.

The same reasoning applies equally to the case of the judge. In order to have a criminal justice system that protects people from being harmed by others, we authorize judges and other officials to impose serious punishments on people who are convicted of crimes. The purpose of this is to provide overall security to people in their jurisdiction, but this requires that criminal justice officials only have the authority to impose arrest and imprisonment on people who are actually believed to be guilty. They do not have the authority to do whatever they think will lead to the best results in particular cases. Whatever they do must be constrained by rules that limit their power. Act utilitarians may sometimes support the intentional punishment of innocent people, but rule utilitarians will understand the risks involved and will oppose a practice that allows it.

Rule utilitarians offer a similar analysis of the promise keeping case. They explain that in general, we want people to keep their promises even in some cases in which doing so may lead to less utility than breaking the promise. The reason for this is that the practice of promise-keeping is a very valuable. It enables people to have a wide range of cooperative relationships by generating confidence that other people will do what they promise to do. If we knew that people would fail to keep promises whenever some option arises that leads to more utility, then we could not trust people who make promises to us to carry them through. We would always have to worry that some better option (one that act utilitarians would favor) might emerge, leading to the breaking of the person’s promise to us.

In each of these cases then, rule utilitarians can agree with the critics of act utilitarianism that it is wrong for doctors, judges, and promise-makers to do case by case evaluations of whether they should harm their patients, convict and punish innocent people, and break promises. The rule utilitarian approach stresses the value of general rules and practices, and shows why compliance with rules often maximizes overall utility even if in some individual cases, it requires doing what produces less utility.

2. Maintaining vs. Undermining Trust

Rule utilitarians see the social impact of a rule-based morality as one of the key virtues of their theory. The three cases just discussed show why act utilitarianism undermines trust but rule utilitarianism does not. Fundamentally, in the cases of doctors, judges, and promise-keepers, it is trust that is at stake. Being able to trust other people is extremely important to our well-being. Part of trusting people involves being able to predict what they will and won’t do. Because act utilitarians are committed to a case by case evaluation method, the adoption of their view would make people’s actions much less predictable. As a result, people would be less likely to see other people as reliable and trustworthy. Rule utilitarianism does not have this problem because it is committed to rules, and these rules generate positive “expectation effects” that give us a basis for knowing how other people are likely to behave.

While rule utilitarians do not deny that there are people who are not trustworthy, they can claim that their moral code generally condemns violations of trust as wrongful acts. The problem with act utilitarians is that they support a moral view that has the effect of undermining trust and that sacrifices the good effects of a moral code that supports and encourages trustworthiness.

3. Impartiality and the Problem of Over-Demandingness

Rule utilitarians believe that their view is also immune to the criticism that act utilitarianism is too demanding. In addition, while the act utilitarian commitment to impartiality undermines the moral relevance of personal relations, rule utilitarians claim that their view is not open to this criticism. They claim that rule utilitarianism allows for partiality toward ourselves and others with whom we share personal relationships. Moreover, they say, rule utilitarianism can recognize justifiable partiality to some people without rejecting the commitment to impartiality that is central to the utilitarian tradition.

How can rule utilitarianism do this? How can it be an impartial moral theory while also allowing partiality in people’s treatment of their friends, family, and others with whom they have a special connection?

In his defense of rule utilitarianism, Brad Hooker distinguishes two different contexts in which partiality and impartiality play a role. One involves the justification of moral rules and the other concerns the application of moral rules. Justifications of moral rules, he claims, must be strictly impartial. When we ask whether a rule should be adopted, it is essential to consider the impact of the rule on all people and to weigh the interests of everyone equally.

The second context concerns the content of the rules and how they are applied in actual cases. Rule utilitarians argue that a rule utilitarian moral code will allow partiality to play a role in determining what morality requires, forbids, or allows us to do. As an example, consider a moral rule parents have a special duty to care for their own children. (See Parental Rights and Obligations.) This is a partialist rule because it not only allows but actually requires parents to devote more time, energy, and other resources to their own children than to others. While it does not forbid devoting resources to other people’s children, it allows people to give to their own. While the content of this rule is not impartial, rule utilitarians believe it can be impartially justified. Partiality toward children can be justified for several reasons. Caring for children is a demanding activity. Children need the special attention of adults to develop physically, emotionally, and cognitively. Because children’s needs vary, knowledge of particular children’s needs is necessary to benefit them. For these reasons, it is plausible to believe that children’s well-being can best be promoted by a division of labor that requires particular parents (or other caretakers) to focus primarily on caring for specific children rather than trying to take care of all children. It is not possible for absentee parents or strangers to provide individual children with all that they need. Therefore, we can maximize the overall well-being of children as a class by designating certain people as the caretakers for specific children. For these reasons, partiality toward specific children can be impartially justified.

Similar “division of labor” arguments can be used to provide impartial justifications of other partialist rules and practices. Teachers, for example have special duties to students in their own classes and have no duty to educate all students. Similarly, public officials can and should be partial to people in the jurisdiction in which they work. If the overall aim is to maximize the well-being of all people in all cities, for example, then we are likely to get better results by having individuals who know and understand particular cities focus on them while other people focus on other cities.

Based on examples like these, rule utilitarians claim that their view, unlike act utilitarianism, avoids the problems raised about demandingness and partiality. Being committed to impartialist justifications of moral rules does not commit them to rejecting moral rules that allow or require people to give specific others priority.

While rule utilitarians can defend partiality, their commitment to maximizing overall utility also allows them to justify limits on the degree of partiality that is morally permissible. At a minimum, rule utilitarians will support a rule that forbids parents to harm other people’s children in order to advance the interests of their own children. (It would be wrong, for example, for a parent to injure children who are running in a school race in order to increase the chances that their own children will win.) Moreover, though this is more controversial, rule utilitarians may support a rule that says that if parents are financially well-off and if their own children’s needs are fully met, these parents may have a moral duty to contribute some resources for children who are deprived of essential resources.

The key point is that while rule utilitarianism permits partiality toward some people, it can also generate rules that limit the ways in which people may act partially and it might even support a positive duty for well off people to provide assistance to strangers when the needs and interests of people to whom we are partial are fully met, when they have surplus resources that could be used to assist strangers in dire conditions, and when there are ways to channel these resources effectively to people in dire need.

b. Arguments against Rule Utilitarianism

i. The “Rule Worship” Objection

Act utilitarians criticize rule utilitarians for irrationally supporting rule-based actions in cases where more good could be done by violating the rule than obeying it. They see this as a form of “rule worship,” an irrational deference to rules that has no utilitarian justification (J. J. C. Smart).

Act utilitarians say that they recognize that rules can have value. For example, rules can provide a basis for acting when there is no time to deliberate. In addition, rules can define a default position, a justification for doing (or refraining from) a type of action as long as there is no reason for not doing it. But when people know that more good can be done by violating the rule then the default position should be over-ridden.

ii. The “Collapses into Act Utilitarianism” Objection

While the “rule worship” objection assumes that rule utilitarianism is different from act utilitarianism, some critics deny that this is the case. In their view, whatever defects act utilitarianism may have, rule utilitarianism will have the same defects. According to this criticism, although rule utilitarianism looks different from act utilitarianism, a careful examination shows that it collapses into or, as David Lyons claimed, is extensionally equivalent to act utilitarianism.

To understand this criticism, it is worth focusing on a distinction between rule utilitarianism and other non-utilitarian theories. Consider Kant’s claim that lying is always morally wrong, even when lying would save a person’s life. Many people see this view as too rigid and claim that it fails to take into account the circumstances in which a lie is being told. A more plausible rule would say “do not lie except in special circumstances that justify lying.” But what are these special circumstances? For a utilitarian, it is natural to say that the correct rule is “do not lie except when lying will generate more good than telling the truth.”

Suppose that a rule utilitarian adopts this approach and advocates a moral code that consists of a list of rules of this form. The rules would say something like “do x except when not doing x maximizes utility” and “do not do x except when doing x maximizes utility.” While this may sound plausible, it is easy to see that this version of rule utilitarianism is in fact identical with act utilitarianism. Whatever action x is, the moral requirement and the moral prohibition expressed in these rules collapses into the act utilitarian rules “do x only when not doing x maximizes utility” or “do not do x except when doing x maximizes utility.” These rules say exactly the same thing as the open-ended act utilitarian rule “Do whatever action maximizes utility.”

If rule utilitarianism is to be distinct from act utilitarianism, its supporters must find a way to formulate rules that allow exceptions to a general requirement or prohibition while not collapsing into act utilitarianism. One way to do this is to identify specific conditions under which violating a general moral requirement would be justified. Instead of saying that we can violate a general rule whenever doing so will maximize utility, the rule utilitarian code might say things like “Do not lie except to prevent severe harms to people who are not unjustifiably threatening others with severe harm.” This type of rule would prohibit lying generally, but it would permit lying to a murderer to prevent harm to the intended victims even if the lie would lead to harm to the murderer. In cases of lesser harms or deceitful acts that will benefit the liar, lying would still be prohibited, even if lying might maximize overall utility.

Rule utilitarians claim that this sort of rule is not open to the “collapses into act utilitarianism” objection. It also suggests, however, that rule utilitarians face difficult challenges in formulating utility-based rules that have a reasonable degree of flexibility built into them but are not so flexible that they collapse into act utilitarianism. In addition, although the rules that make up a moral code should be flexible enough to account for the complexities of life, they cannot be so complex that they are too difficult for people to learn and understand.

iii. Wrong Answers and Crude Concepts

Although rule utilitarians try to avoid the weaknesses attributed to act utilitarianism, critics argue that they cannot avoid these weaknesses because they do not take seriously many of our central moral concepts. As a result, they cannot support the right answers to crucial moral problems. Three prominent concepts in moral thought that critics cite are justice, rights, and desert. These moral ideas are often invoked in reasoning about morality, but critics claim that neither rule nor act utilitarianism acknowledge their importance. Instead, they focus only on the amounts of utility that actions or rules generate.

In considering the case, for example, of punishing innocent people, the best that rule utilitarians can do is to say that a rule that permits this would lead to worse results overall than a rule that permitted it. This prediction, however, is precarious. While it may be true, it may also be false, and if it is false, then utilitarians must acknowledge that intentionally punishing an innocent person could sometimes be morally justified.

Against this, critics may appeal to common sense morality to support the view that there are no circumstances in which punishing the innocent can be justified because the innocent person is a) being treated unjustly, b) has a right not to be punished for something that he or she is not guilty of, and c) does not deserve to be punished for a crime that he or she did not commit.

In responding, rule utilitarians may begin, first, with the view that they do not reject concepts like justice, rights, and desert. Instead, they accept and use these concepts but interpret them from the perspective of maximizing utility. To speak of justice, rights, and desert is to speak of rules of individual treatment that are very important, and what makes them important is their contribution to promoting overall well-being. Moreover, even people who accept these concepts as basic still need to determine whether it is always wrong to treat someone unjustly, violate their rights, or treat them in ways that they don’t deserve.

Critics object to utilitarianism by claiming that the theory justifies treating people unjustly, violating their rights, etc. This criticism only stands up if it is always wrong and thus never morally justified to treat people in these ways.  Utilitarians  argue that moral common sense is less absolutist than their critics acknowledge. In the case of punishment, for example, while we hope that our system of criminal justice gives people fair trials and conscientiously attempts to separate the innocent from the guilty, we know that the system is not perfect. As a result, people who are innocent are sometimes prosecuted, convicted, and punished for crimes they did not do.

This is the problem of wrongful convictions, which poses a difficult challenge to critics of utilitarianism. If we know that our system of criminal justice punishes some people unjustly and in ways they don’t deserve, we are faced with a dilemma. Either we can shut down the system and punish no one, or we can maintain the system even though we know that it will result in some innocent people being unjustly punished in ways that they do not deserve. Most people will support continuing to punish people in spite of the fact that it involves punishing some people unjustly. According to rule utilitarians, this can only be justified if a rule that permits punishments (after a fair trial, etc.) yields more overall utility than a rule that rejects punishment because it treats some people unfairly. To end the practice of punishment entirely—because it inevitably causes some injustice—is likely to result in worse consequences because it deprives society of a central means of protecting people’s well-being, including what are regarded as their rights. In the end, utilitarians say, it is justice and rights that give way when rules that approve of violations in some cases yield the greatest amount of utility.

5. Conclusion

The debate between act utilitarianism and rule utilitarianism highlights many important issues about how we should make moral judgments. Act utilitarianism stresses the specific context and the many individual features of the situations that pose moral problems, and it presents a single method for dealing with these individual cases. Rule utilitarianism stresses the recurrent features of human life and the ways in which similar needs and problems arise over and over again. From this perspective, we need rules that deal with types or classes of actions: killing, stealing, lying, cheating, taking care of our friends or family, punishing people for crimes, aiding people in need, etc. Both of these perspectives, however, agree that the main determinant of what is right or wrong is the relationship between what we do or what form our moral code takes and what is the impact of our moral perspective on the level of people’s well-being.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Classic Works

  • Jeremy Bentham.  An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, available in many editions, 1789.
    • See Book I, chapter 1 for Bentham’s statement of what utilitarianism is; chapter IV for his method of measuring amounts of pleasure/utility; chapter V for his list of types of pleasures and pains, and chapter XIII for his application of utilitarianism to questions about criminal punishment.
  • John Stuart Mill. Utilitarianism, available in many editions and online, 1861.
    • See especially chapter II, in which Mill tries both to clarify and defend utilitarianism. Passages at the end of chapter suggest that Mill was a rule utilitarian. In chapter V, Mill tries to show that utilitarianism is compatible with justice.
  • Henry Sidgwick. The Methods of Ethics, Seventh Edition, available in many editions, 1907.
    • Sidgwick is known for his careful, extended analysis of utilitarian moral theory and competing views.
  • G. E. Moore. Principia Ethica, 1903.
    • Moore criticizes aspects of Mill’s views but support a non-hedonistic form of utilitarianism.
  • G. E. Moore. Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1912.
    • Mostly focused on utilitarianism, this book contains a combination of act and rule utilitarian ideas.

b. More Recent Utilitarians

  • J. J. C. Smart. “An Outline of a System of Utilitarian Ethics” in J. J. C. Smart and Bernard Williams, Utilitarianism: For and Against. Cambridge University Press, 1973.
    • Smart’s discussion combines an overview of moral theory and a defense of act utilitarianism. It is followed by Bernard Williams’, “A Critique of Utilitarianism,” a source of many important criticisms of utilitarianism.
  • Richard Brandt. Ethical Theory. Prentice Hall, 1959. Chapter 15.
    • Brandt, who coined the terms “act” and “rule” utilitarianism, explains and criticizes act utilitarianism and tentatively proposes a version of rule utilitarianism.
  • Richard Brandt. Morality, Utilitarianism, and Rights. Cambridge University Press, 1992.
    • Brandt developed and defended rule utilitarianism in many papers. This book contains several of them as well as works in which he applies rule utilitarian thinking to issues like rights and the ethics of war.
  • R. M. Hare. Moral Thinking. Oxford University Press, 1981.
    • An interesting development of a form of rule utilitarianism by an influential moral theorist.
  • John C. Harsanyi. “Morality and the Theory of Rational Behavior.” in Social Research 44.4 (1977): 623-656. (Reprinted in Amartya Sen and Bernard Williams, eds., Utilitarianism and Beyond, Cambridge University Press, 1982).
    • Harsanyi, a Nobel Prize economist, defends rule utilitarianism, connecting it to a preference theory of value and a theory of rational action.
  • John Rawls. “Two Concepts of Rules.” In Philosophical Review LXIV (1955), 3-32.
    • Before becoming an influential critic of utilitarianism, Rawls wrote this defense of rule utilitarianism.
  • Brad Hooker.  Ideal Code, Real World: A Rule-consequentialist Theory of Morality. Oxford University Press, 2000.
    • In this 21st century defense of rule utilitarianism, Hooker places it in the context of more recent developments in philosophy.
  • Peter Singer. Writings on an Ethical Life. HarperCollins, 2000.
    • Singer, a prolific, widely read thinker, mostly applies a utilitarian perspective to controversial moral issues (for example, euthanasia, the treatment of non-human animals, and global poverty) rather than discussing utilitarian moral theory. This volume contains selections from his books and articles.
  • Peter Singer. “Famine, Affluence, and Morality” in Philosophy and Public Affairs 1 (1972), 229-43. Reprinted in Peter Singer. Writings on an Ethical Life. Harper Collins, 2000.
    • This widely reprinted article, though it does not focus on utilitarianism, uses utilitarian reasoning and has sparked decades of debate about moral demandingness and moral impartiality.
  • Robert Goodin. Utilitarianism as a Public Philosophy. Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • In a series of essays, Goodin argues that utilitarianism is the best philosophy for public decision-making even if it fails as an ethic for personal aspects of life.
  • Derek Parfit.  On What Matters. Oxford University Press, 1991.
    • In a long, complex work, Parfit stresses the importance of Henry Sidgwick as a moral philosopher and argues that rule utilitarianism and Kantian deontology can be understood in a way that makes them compatible with one another.

c. Overviews

  • Tim Mulgan. Understanding Utilitarianism. Acumen, 2007.
    • This is a very clear description of utilitarianism, including explanations of arguments both for and against. Chapter 2 discusses Bentham, Mill, and Sidgwick while chapter 6 focuses on act and rule utilitarianism.
  • Julia Driver, “The History of Utilitarianism,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • This article gives a good historical account of important figures in the development of utilitarianism.
  • Walter Sinnott-Armstrong, “Consequentialism,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • This very useful overview is relevant to utilitarianism and other forms of consequentialism.
  • William Shaw. Contemporary Ethics: Taking Account of Utilitarianism. Blackwell, 1999.
    • Shaw provides a clear, comprehensive discussion of utilitarianism and its critics as well as defending utilitarianism.
  • John Troyer. The Classical Utilitarians: Bentham and Mill. Hackett, 2003.
    • Troyer’s introduction to this book of selections from Mill and Bentham is clear and informative.
  • Ben Eggleston and Dale Miller, eds. The Cambridge Companion to Utilitarianism. Cambridge University Press, 2014.
    • This collection contains sixteen essays on utilitarianism, including essays on historical figures as well as  discussion of 21st century issues, including both act and rule utilitarianism.

d. J. S. Mill and Utilitarian Moral Theory

  • J. O. Urmson. “The Interpretation of the Moral Philosophy of J. S. Mill,” in Philosophical Quarterly (1953) 3, 33-9.
    • This article generated renewed interest in both Mill’s moral theory and rule utilitarianism.
  • Roger Crisp. Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Mill on Utilitarianism. Routledge, 1997.
  • A clear discussion of Mill’s Utilitarianism with chapters on key topics as well as on Mill’s On Liberty and The Subjection of Women.
  • Henry. R. West, ed. The Blackwell Guide to Mill’s Utilitarianism. Blackwell, 2006.
    • This contains the complete text of Mill’s Utilitarianism   preceded by three essays on the background to Mill’s utilitarianism and followed by five interpretative essays and four focusing on contemporary issues.
  • Henry R. West. An Introduction to Mill’s Utilitarian Ethics. Cambridge University Press, 2004.
    • A clear discussion of Mill; Chapter 4 argues that Mill is neither an act nor a rule utilitarian. Chapter 6 focuses on utilitarianism and justice.
  • Dale Miller. J. S. Mill. Polity Press, 2010.
    • Miller, in Chapter 6, argues that Mill was a rule utilitarian.
  • Stephen Nathanson. “John Stuart Mill on Economic Justice and the Alleviation of Poverty,” in Journal of Social Philosophy, XLIII, no. 2.
    • Drawing on Mill’s Principles of Political Economy, Nathanson claims that Mill was a rule utilitarian and provides an interpretation of Mill’s views on economic justice.
  • Wendy Donner, “Mill’s Utilitarianism” in John Skorupski, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Mill. Cambridge University Press, 1998, 255–92.
    • A discussion of Mill’s views and some recent interpretations of them.
  • David Lyons. Rights, Welfare, and Mill’s Moral Theory. Oxford, 1994.
    • In this series of papers, Lyons defends Mill’s view of morality against some critics, differentiates Mill’s views from  both act and rule utilitarianism, and criticizes Mill’s attempt to show that utilitarianism can account for justice.

e. Critics of Utilitarianism

  • David Lyons.  Forms and Limits of Utilitarianism. Oxford, 1965.
    • Lyons argues that at least some versions of rule utilitarianism collapse into act utilitarianism.
  • David Lyons. “The Moral Opacity of Utilitarianism” in Brad Hooker, Elinor Mason, and Dale Miller, eds. Morality, Rules, and Consequences. Rowman and Littlefield, 2000.
    • In a challenging essay, Lyons raises doubts about whether there is any coherent version of utilitarianism.
  • Judith Jarvis Thomson. “The Trolley Problem.” Yale Law Journal 94 (1985), 1395-1415. Reprinted in Judith Jarvis Thomson. Rights, Restitution and Risk. Edited by William Parent. Harvard University Press, 1986; Chapter 7.
    • An influential rights-based discussion in which Jarvis Thomson uses hypothetical cases to show, among other things, that utilitarianism cannot explain while some actions that cause killings are permissible and others not.
  • Bernard Williams, “A Critique of Utilitarianism,” In J. J. C. Smart and Bernard Williams, Utilitarianism: For and Against. Cambridge University Press, 1973.
    • Williams’ contribution to this debate contains arguments and examples that have played an important role in debates about utilitarianism and moral theory.

f. Collections of Essays

  • Michael D. Bayles, ed. Contemporary Utilitarianism. Garden City: Doubleday, 1968.
    • Ten essays that debate act vs. rule utilitarianism as well as whether a form of utilitarianism is correct.
  • Samuel Gorovitz, ed. John Stuart Mill: Utilitarianism, With Critical Essays. Indianapolis: The Bobbs-Merrill Company, 1971.
    • This includes Mill’s Utlitarianism plus a rich array of twenty-eight (pre-1970) articles interpreting, defending, and criticizing utilitarianism.
  • Brad Hooker, Elinor Mason, and Dale Miller, eds. Morality, Rules, and Consequences. Rowman and Littlefield, 2000.
    • Thirteen essays on utilitarianism, many focused on issues concerning rule utilitarianism.
  • Samuel Scheffler. Consequentialism and Its Critics. Oxford, 1988.
    • This contains a dozen influential articles, mostly by prominent critics of utilitarianism and other forms of consequentialism.
  • Amartya Sen, and Bernard Williams, eds. Utilitarianism and Beyond. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982.
    • This contains fourteen articles, including essays defending utilitarianism by R. M. Hare and John Harsanyi, As the title suggests, however, most of the articles are critical of utilitarianism.


Author Information

Stephen Nathanson
Northeastern University
U. S. A.

The Meaning of Life: Early Continental and Analytic Perspectives

The question of the meaning of life is one that interests philosophers and non-philosophers alike. The question itself is notoriously ambiguous and possibly vague. In asking about the meaning of life, one may be asking about the essence of life, about life's purpose, about whether and how anything matters, or a host of other things.

Not everyone is plagued by questions about life's meaning, but some are. The circumstances in which one does ask about life's meaning include those in which: one is well off but bothered by either a sense of dissatisfaction or the prospect of bad things to come; one is young at heart and has a sense of wonder; one is perplexed by the discordant plurality of things and wants to find some unity in all the diversity; or one has lost faith in old values and narratives and wants to know how to live in order to have a meaningful life.

We may read our ancestors in such a way that warrants the claim that the meaning of life has been a human concern from the beginning. But it was only early in the nineteenth century that writers began to write directly about "the meaning of life." The most significant writers were: Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, and Tolstoy. Schopenhauer ended up saying that the meaning of life is to deny it; Kierkegaard, that the meaning of life is to obey God passionately; Nietzsche, that the meaning of life is the will to power; and Tolstoy, that the meaning of life lies in a kind of irrational knowledge called "faith."

In the twentieth century, in the Continental tradition, Heidegger held that the meaning of life is to live authentically or (alternatively) to be a guardian of the earth.  Sartre espoused the view that life is meaningless but urged us nonetheless to make a free choice that would give our lives meaning and responsibility. Camus also thought that life is absurd and meaningless. The best way to cope with this fact, he held, is to live life with passion, using everything up, and with an attitude of revolt, defiance, or scorn.

In the Anglo-American tradition, William James held that life is meaningful and worth living because of a spiritual order in which we should believe, or else that it is meaningful when there is a marriage of ideals with pluck, will, and the manly virtues; Bertrand Russell argued that to live a meaningful life one must abandon private and petty interests and instead cultivate an interest in the eternal; Moritz Schlick argued that the meaning of life is to be found in play; and A. J. Ayer asserted that the question of the meaning of life is itself meaningless.

All of these set the table for a veritable feast of philosophical writing on the meaning of life that began in the 1950s with Kurt Baier's essay "The Meaning of Life," followed in 1970 by Richard Taylor's influential essay on the same topic, followed shortly by Thomas Nagel's important 1971 essay on "The Absurd." See "Meaning of Life: The Analytic Perspective" for more on the course of the debate in analytic philosophy about the meaning of life.

Table of Contents

  1. Background
    1. The Origin of the English Expression "the Meaning of Life"
    2. Questions about the Meaning of Life
    3. The Broader Historical Background
  2. Nineteenth Century Philosophers
    1. Schopenhauer
    2. Kierkegaard
    3. Nietzsche
    4. Tolstoy
    5. Some Common Aspects of the Lives of Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, and Tolstoy
  3. Early Twentieth Century Continental Philosophers
    1. Heidegger
    2. Sartre
    3. Camus
  4. Early Twentieth Century Analytic, American, and English-Language Philosophers
    1. James
    2. Russell
    3. Schlick
    4. Tagore
    5. Ayer
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Background

a. The Origin of the English Expression "the Meaning of Life"

The English term "meaning" dates back to the fourteenth century C.E. Its origins, according to the Oxford English Dictionary (OED), lie in the Middle English word "meenyng" (also spelled "menaynge," "meneyng," and "mennyng").

In its earliest occurrences, in English original compositions as well as in English translations of earlier works, meaning is most often what, on the one hand, sentences, utterances, and stories, and, on the other hand, dreams, visions, signs, omens, and rituals have or might have. One asks about the meaning of some puzzling utterance, or of the writing on the wall, or of the vision that appeared to somebody in the night, or of the ritual performed on a hallowed occasion. Meaning is often conceived of as something non-obvious and somewhat secretive, discernible only by a seer granted with special powers.

It is much later that life is spoken of as something that might, or might not, have meaning in this sense. Such speech would have to wait upon the development of the concept of life as something like a word, a linguistic utterance, a narrative, a story, a gesture, a puzzling episode, a sign, a dream, a vision, or a surface phenomenon that points to some deep inner essence, to which it would be proper to inquire into its meaning, or to apply epithets like "meaningful" or "meaningless." One of the earliest instances of the occurrence of the concept "life" as such a thing, as signifying something that might or might not have something like meaning, appears in Shakespeare's Macbeth (c. 1605), where Macbeth characterizes life as "a tale told by an idiot, full of sound and fury, signifying nothing." But notice that even here the words "meaning" and "life" are not linked.

The OED's definition of "meaning" in something like our sense is "The significance, purpose, underlying truth, etc., of something." Further elaboration of early uses of the word gives us, "That which is indicated or expressed by a (supposed) symbol or symbolic action; spec. a message, warning, idea, etc., supposed to be symbolized by a dream, vision, omen, etc." A bit later, in one of its senses, meaning takes on the sense in which it is the "signification; intention; cause, purpose; motive, justification," . . . "[o]f an action, condition, etc." Finally we get the sense that most nearly concerns us here: "Something which gives one a sense of purpose, value, etc., esp. of a metaphysical or spiritual kind; the (perceived) purpose of existence or of a person's life. Freq. in the meaning of life." (All this is from the OED.)

The first English use of the expression "the meaning of life" appeared in 1834 in Thomas Carlyle's (1795-1881) Sartor Resartus II. ix, where Teufelsdrockh observes, "our Life is compassed round with Necessity; yet is the meaning of Life itself no other than Freedom." The usage shortly caught on, and over the next century and a half the phrase "the meaning of life" became common. The adjective "meaningful" did not appear until 1852, the noun "meaningfulness" until 1904.

b. Questions about the Meaning of Life

The most familiar form of the question(s) about the meaning of life is simply, "What is the meaning of life?" Although the form of the question is one, when it is asked, any one (or more) of several different senses may be intended. Here are some of the more common of them.

(1) In some cases, what the seeker seeks is the kernel, the inner reality, the core, or the essence, underlying some phenomenon. Thus one might ask what his essence, his true self is, and then feel that he has found the meaning of his life if he discovers that true self.

(2) In other cases, the question is about the point, aim, object, purpose, end, or goal of life, typically one's own. Here, in some cases, the question is about some pre-existing purpose that the questioner might (or might not) discover; in other cases, the question might be about some end or purpose the agent might invent or create and give her life. The latter questioner, when she is successful, may believe that her life has a meaning because she herself has given it one.

(3) In yet other cases, the question of the meaning of life is that of whether our lives, and anything we do within them, matter, or have any sort of importance. If one can show that they matter, and in virtue of what they do, one will have provided a substantive answer to the question of the meaning of life. A common, but not universal, assumption on this score is that our lives have significance and importance only if they issue in some lasting achievement the ravages of time will not destroy.

(4) In still other cases, what bothers the questioner is the discord, plurality, and chaotic nature of his apparent empirical life as it is actually lived. He can make no sense of it; there is no rhyme or reason to it. The drive here, one might well think, is to see one's life as intelligible, as something that makes sense. The discovery or invention of some kind of unity in his life would amount to an answer to his question, "What is the meaning of life?"

(5) Yet another thing the question about the meaning of life can be is a request for a narrative or picture, a way of seeing life (perhaps a metaphorical one) that enables one to make sense of it and achieve a sense of meaning while living it. And so we get "Life is a bowl of cherries" and various and sundry religious narratives.

(6) Sometimes what the questioner is really wondering is whether it makes sense to go on and his question is "Is life worth living?" He may actually be contemplating suicide. His predicament has to do with meaning if he is assuming that it makes sense to continue living only if (his) life has a suitable meaning, something which, at the moment, he can't see it as having.

(7) Finally, the question of the meaning of life can be the question of how one should live in order to have a meaningful life, or, if such a life is impossible, then what the best way to live meaninglessly is.

The seven questions just distinguished may be, but need not be, discrete and self-contained. A given seeker may very well be interested in several of them at once and see them as intimately connected. For example, a person may be interested in his core or essence because he thinks that knowledge of that may reveal the goal or purpose of his life, a purpose that makes his life seem important and intelligible, and gives him a reason for going on, as well as insight into how he must live in order to have a meaningful life. It is commonly the case that several of the questions press themselves on the seeker all at the same time.

One or more of these questions were of concern to the philosophers discussed below. Some were concerned with nearly all of them. Distinct from all the above are second-order, analytic, conceptual questions of the sort that dominate current philosophical discussion of the issue in analytic circles. These questions are not so much about the meaning of life as about the meaning of "the meaning of life" and its component concepts ("meaning," "life"), or related ones ("meaningfulness," "meaninglessness," "vanity," "absurdity," and so forth).

c. The Broader Historical Background

Although nineteenth century thinkers were the first in the West to put the question precisely in the form "What is the meaning of life?" concern with questions in what may be called "the meaning-of-life family," that is, ultimate questions about life, the world, existence, and its purpose may be found, in the East and the West alike, almost as far back as we can trace human thought about anything. Thus Gilgamesh (c. 2000 B.C.E.) asked why he must die; the composers of The Rig Veda (c. 1200 B.C.E.) wondered where everything came from; Job (c. 500 B.C.E.) asked why he must suffer; the ancient Taoists (Laozi c. 500 B.C.E. and Zhuangzi c. 300 B.C.E.) asked what the origin or principle of everything is, and how one must live to be in accord with it; ancient Upanishadic seekers (500-300 B.C.E.) were much vexed with the nature of the true self and its end or goal; the Buddha (c. 500 B.C.E.), before he became the Buddha, sought an understanding of life that would enable one to overcome suffering; the author of The Bhagavad Gita (c. 200 B.C.E.) was concerned, as other Indian thinkers tended to be, with the identity and nature of the true self, and also with the question of how to live; the ancient Greeks of the classical period (c. 430-320 B.C.E.) talked about the goal or end of life and how to reach it; Epicurus (341-270 B.C.E.) followed suit and developed his own unique take on these matters; Qoheleth, the author of Ecclesiastes (c. 200 B.C.E.), was struck by the vanity or futility of everything and wondered how to deal with it; Greek and Roman Hellenistic philosophers (c. 300 B.C.E. - 250 C.E.)—Epicurean, Stoic, Cynic, Skeptic, and Neo-Platonist—wondered about the good and how to achieve it; Marcus Aurelius (121-180 C.E.) mused on his cosmic insignificance.

The Christian-dominated medieval period did not produce thinkers who asked in any radical way about the meaning of life, because everyone already had a perfectly good answer, the one provided by the Christian story. Still, even in medieval times, there was room for at least three questions in the meaning-of-life family. First, there was occasion for the questions when things ran counter to the Christian story, or to what one expected. Thus Boethius (480-525) was perplexed by the deep questions when, after a life of honor, piety, and power, he fell into disgrace, had everything stripped from him unaccountably and unjustly, and found himself faced with imprisonment that lead eventually to his execution. Second, though the great Christian philosopher-theologians thought they knew the meaning of life in outline, they still asked and answered questions about the details of the final or highest good of man. Thomas Aquinas (1224-1274), for example, who accepted with unblinking assurance the general answer supplied by Christianity, found himself wondering about the exact nature of the summum bonum (the highest good) and about how to square the Christian view of it with that of Aristotle. Third, other Christian believers, medieval ones as well as present-day ones with medieval outlooks, committed to an overall view of what is going on, may be vexed by the question of what God intends for them specifically and may worry about their "calling," the particular purpose, role, or plan God has especially for them. Hence we find confirmed believers worried deeply about the question, "What is the meaning of my life?"

In any event, since the early modern period, there has been a resurgence of interest in fundamental meaning-of-life questions. Writers as diverse as Shakespeare (1564-1616), Pascal (1623-1662), Dr. Johnson (1709-84), Kant (1724-1804), and Hegel (1770-1831) have asked, in different forms, questions about life's ultimate point, goal, or purpose, and they are just a few of the many religious, philosophical, and literary figures who have raised and (sometimes) answered ultimate questions in the meaning-of-life family prior to Schopenhauer's work early in the nineteenth century. There have been philosophers too since Schopenhauer's time who have addressed the big questions, but not explicitly in terms of "the meaning of life." This article will confine itself largely to those philosophers who have explicitly put their concerns in those terms.

The standard explanation of the rise of questions about life's meaning in the early modern period points to three or four distinct but related things: (1) the scientific revolution; (2) the Protestant Reformation; (3) voyages and travels of exploration and discovery, in which were encountered peoples with very different outlooks on the nature of the universe and the meaning of life; and (4), as a result of all of these, the evaporation of a widely held, firmly believed Christian conception of the nature of things.

2. Nineteenth Century Philosophers

Let us turn now to the story of what philosophers from Schopenhauer in the early 1800s to Ayer and Camus in the 1940s have had to say about the meaning of life.

a. Schopenhauer

The first Western philosopher to link the ideas of life and meaning, and to ask expressly "What is the meaning of life?" was the great German pessimist Arthur Schopenhauer (1788-1860). At least he was the first to ask the question and get it noticed by other philosophers. Schopenhauer, a contemporary of Carlyle, wrote in German, in which "the meaning of life" is "der Sinn des Lebens." Profoundly influencing the thought of both Nietzsche and Tolstoy, Schopenhauer's work may be regarded as the springboard that launched modern Western philosophical inquiry into the problem of the meaning of life. Here is the passage in which Schopenhauer explicitly asked the question:

Since a man does not alter, and his moral character remains absolutely the same all through his life; since   he must play out the part which he has received, without the least deviation from the character; since   neither experience, nor philosophy, nor religion can effect any improvement in him, the question arises, What is the meaning of life at all? (1860b) [emphasis added]

The circumstances under which concern with the problem of the meaning of life were, in Schopenhauer's case, not merely academic but real and personal. Well off financially, but struggling with personal misery and a sense of loneliness and isolation, he felt driven to find some understanding of himself and of the world around him that seemed so bleak and senseless.

Schopenhauer's philosophy begins with a metaphysical structure he inherited from Kant and more or less simply decrees. There is a difference between the thing-in-itself and the phenomenal world of appearances. The thing-in-itself is the will to live, or, more simply, the will. It is the fundamental power and reality that underlies all things. The world we know and live in, with its stupendous abundance of things and forms, is merely the phenomena of the will, the objectification of it, its mirror, something not entirely real, or not real at all. (There is also a pure, will-less subject of knowledge whose metaphysical status is unclear: sometimes it seems to be in the very realm of the will, the realm of true reality, of things-in-themselves; at other times it seems to be something like the first creation and objectification of the will.)

The will itself just wills. It is pretty nasty, perhaps demonic. It is a blind striving, craving, and grasping, aiming at nothing in the end, except to go on willing and aggrandizing itself. It has in itself an inner contradiction, manifest in the constant struggle and strife between the billions of individual objectifications of itself in the phenomenal world. I am one such objectification; you are another. My true self, my inner essence, is the will; the same is true of you: my essence and yours are one and the same. When we fight (as we usually do), the will is engaged in a battle with itself.

The phenomenal world is an awful place. It is full of misery, pain, suffering. Little happiness is found anywhere. The twin poles of human life are pain (want, desire, stress) and boredom. Almost everyone lives a life that, from without, is meaningless and insignificant and, from within, dull and senseless.

But what is the meaning of life? The question is appropriate because life as we know it is something like Macbeth's tale told by an idiot, a "farce." If the question is about life's inner essence, Schopenhauer's answer is simply "the will-to-live." The meaning of life is the will.

Another way of taking the question "What is the meaning of life?" is to construe it as a question about the goal, point, aim, end, or purpose of life. When Schopenhauer explicitly asks the question (in On Human Nature), it is this sense of it he appears to have in mind. His answer is depressing. The point or purpose of life is to suffer. We are being punished for the crime of being born, punished for who we are, namely, the nasty thoroughly egoistic will. The meaning of life in this sense, then, is to suffer, to be punished for our sin.

Schopenhauer suggests a number of ways of thinking about our phenomenal, experienced life. All of them are pretty bleak. He recommends that we look upon our life: as an unprofitable episode interrupting the blessed calm of nothingness; as on the whole a disappointment, nay, a cheat; as Hell, in which on the one hand men are the tormented souls and on the other the tormenting devils; as a place of atonement, a sort of penal colony; as some kind of mistake; and as a process of disillusionment. Any or all of these could be taken as answers to the question "What is the meaning of life?" (or to the question "What is life?")

If we ask what we should do, how we can give our lives worth and meaning, Schopenhauer does have an answer. "Salvation" lies in the total denial of the will. Knowledge of the will and its horrific phenomena can and should function as a quieter of the will, bringing it to a state in which it stops willing and effectively abolishes itself. Thinking in this vein, a Schopenhauerian might say that the meaning of life is to deny, quiet, and eventually abolish the will to live that is essentially oneself.

One naturally wants to know whether this is not just suicide—whether the cessation of willing simply means that one passes into a state of nothingness. Schopenhauer's answer is "No." The state of the will-less individual after death seems to be nothing to us; but our present state would seem to be nothing to him. His state is wonderful and blessed, but what it is like is inconceivable to us.

In our current state, when one denies the will in herself, she does not literally commit suicide. Suicide doesn't work because it is itself a powerful act of willing. Instead, she practices self-denial and asceticism, cultivates detachment, stops wanting and pursuing the things most people go for; and although there is still some struggle with the dying will in her, on the whole her life becomes full of peace and joy. The will is quieted and eventually abolishes itself in the individual. Very few people are capable of doing this heroic thing, Schopenhauer says, but he himself does not claim to be one of these people.

For all the darkness of his philosophy, the moral for all of us—even those of us who are not prepared to totally deny the will—which Schopenhauer derives in the end is very much in the Christian/Buddhist vein. We should not be competitive or grasping or villainous, but rather we should show compassion and kindness to everyone, since everyone is always having a bad day in this hell we are all living in, and what we all need above all are love, compassion, help, and consideration. The fundamental principle of morality, which you should follow, is: Don't hurt anyone; help everyone you can. Following this principle, one can achieve, short of complete denial of the will, a kind of half-way salvation.

Another of Schopenhauer's points about meaning in life should be mentioned. It is that the meaningfulness of one's life depends not on one's outer circumstances but rather on the way one looks at life. People look at life differently, and so the meaningfulness of her life varies considerably from person to person. To one person life is barren, dull, and superficial; to another rich, interesting, and full of meaning.

b. Kierkegaard

A major nineteenth century European philosopher who continued the tradition of thought on the meaning of life was the Danish philosopher Soren Kierkegaard (1813-1855). Kierkegaard was not an academic. The sources of his interest in problems of meaning seem to have been his not having to work for a living, his personal demons, his Nordic gloom, his congenital tendencies toward guilt, depression, anxiety, and dread, his awareness of increasing doubt all around him of the teachings of his inherited Christianity, and his agonizing failure to live up to his own Christian ideals, primarily because of his embodiment and its concomitant proclivity for the things of the flesh, especially sensuousness and sex.  Out of all that emerged what appears to be a severe case of self-loathing, which in turn prompted serious inquiry into the meaning of (his) life.

It is difficult to determine what Kierkegaard's own views were on just about everything because he constantly used humor, satire, paradox, and irony, and even more because he spoke in different voices and wrote from different perspectives under different pseudonyms.

Nonetheless, the standard view is that Kierkegaard was fundamentally a Christian. He claimed that one's life can be meaningful and worth living only if one believes genuinely and passionately in the Christian God.

And then there is the leap. Christian belief goes beyond rational evidence, and even conflicts with it. One must make a leap from knowledge to Christian faith—the only thing in which one can find true meaning—a leap over the confines of common sense and reason. One is to accept Christian faith even if (or just because?) it is absurd. For it is the only adequate source of the kind of meaning a human being has to have to keep on going with a sense that life is worthwhile.

Another way to describe Kierkegaard's overall philosophy is to characterize it in terms of his three stages or levels of life. One should make an ascent from the lowest stage, the aesthetic (sensuous, even sensual), through the higher ethical stage, and on to the highest stage of all, the religious, which somehow baptizes and incorporates the two lower stages into itself. Only one who has reached the religious stage can have a truly meaningful life and thus a life worth living.

Whatever Kierkegaard's own view was, we can make the following observations about things Kierkegaard (or one or other of his pseudonymous authors) said about the meaning of life.

(1) One thing is that life can seem meaningless. In the early work, Either/Or (1843), we find this passage: "How empty and meaningless life is." Elsewhere in Either/Or we get similar thoughts and questions, for instance, "What, if anything, is the meaning of this life?" and "My life is utterly meaningless." Perhaps, though, the idea is that, though life is often meaningless, it need not be so, and, when it is, it is because of some kind of failure of the liver (of the life, not the organ).

(2) A second interesting idea in Kierkegaard is that meaning has something to do with unity. In a meaningful life all the diverse aspects of it come together to form some kind of coherent whole. One pursues some one goal, to which everything in one's life is subordinated.

(3) A third point, an important one, is that, though meaning is a good thing, it is possible for there to be too much meaning in one's life, or in its parts. Kierkegaard observes:

 No part of life ought to have so much meaning for a person that he cannot forget it any moment he wants to; on the other hand, every single part of life ought to have so much meaning for a person that he can     remember it at any moment. (Either/Or)

To have one's life full of meaning to the brim, to regard life and everything one does in it as infinitely significant, brings with it so much pressure and stress that one's life becomes unbearable.

To me [says Kierkegaard] it seems . . . that to be known in time by God makes life enormously strenuous. Everywhere where he is present each half hour is of infinite importance. Yet to live like that for sixty years is unsupportable. It is difficult enough putting up even with the three years’ hard study for an examination, and those are still not as strenuous as half an hour like this. (Concluding Unscientific Postscript)

(4) A fourth idea about meaning in Kierkegaard is the idea that one can give one's life meaning, or that one can acquire meaning in life, by doing something like devoting oneself to something. Of Antigone he says, "her life acquires meaning for her in its devotion to showing him [her father, after his death] the last honors daily, almost hourly, by her unbroken silence." (Either/Or)

(5) Meaning does not come from abstract, objective knowledge of any kind, whether philosophical, or scientific, or historical, or even theological. It comes from some kind of faith, a faith that is passionately acquired and lived daily.

(6) One twentieth century approach to the problem of the meaning of life is to see, accept, and bask more or less happily in the absurdity of life. Kierkegaard anticipated this approach prophetically in his characterization of the "humorist." Kierkegaard writes: "Weary of time and its endless succession, the humorist runs away and finds humorous relief in stating the absurd." (Concluding Unscientific Postscript)

(7) Kierkegaard's humorist also at one point expresses a view which is surprisingly rare, namely, the view that one's life may have a meaning, but one doesn't know what it is. Kierkegaard writes: “[L]et a humorist say what he has in mind and he will speak, for example, as follows: What is the meaning of life? Yes, good question. How should I know?" (Concluding Unscientific Postscript)

(8) Although Kierkegaard himself was a Christian who viewed meaning as ultimately grounded in religious faith, in one's personal relation to a supernatural God, yet, paradoxically perhaps, and certainly in an admirable spirit of non-exclusivity, he said:

It is possible both to enjoy life and to give it meaning and substance outside Christianity, just as the most    famous poets and artists, the most eminent of thinkers, even men of piety, have lived outside Christianity (Concluding Unscientific Postscript).

(9) One finds in Kierkegaard the idea that life has meaning only insofar as it is related in some way to the Infinite. Nothing finite can supply the meaning of life.

On the whole, if for no other reason, Kierkegaard's work is valuable because of its suggestiveness. Under one pseudonym or another, Kierkegaard made many important points which were taken up, or unfortunately overlooked, by subsequent philosophers concerned with the meaning of life.

c. Nietzsche

Friedrich Nietzsche (1844-1900) cut his philosophical teeth on Schopenhauer and devoted himself in his later works—from 1883 up to the onset of insanity in January 1889—to struggle with, among other things, the meaning of life.

Nietzsche's grand project was the revaluation of all values. Part of this project was that of giving to life a new meaning. Nietzsche's interest in the matter was not merely academic. Coming up with new values and giving life a new meaning was a project that involved a total transformation of Nietzsche's own self, early versions of which he became dissatisfied with. One thing Nietzsche wanted to do was to produce an affirmative philosophy of life to replace Schopenhauer's pessimistic, life-denying philosophy.

Nietzsche rejected Schopenhauer's picture of life as suffering, or punishment for one's sin, together with its ethic of compassion toward the poor and the sick. Such a picture belonged to a weak, sick, decadent, nay-saying mode of being in decline. Nietzsche himself wanted to produce a positive, healthy, life-affirming philosophy, one suitable for life in the ascendant.

Sometimes, particularly early in his writings, Nietzsche seemed to think some end or other is required to make things meaningful. At times, both early and late, Nietzsche spoke as though the very concept of the meaning of something is the concept of its end, object, or goal.

In other places, however, Nietzsche spoke as if the meaning of life lies in freedom from, not in the achievement of, ends. Perhaps this should be construed as the rejection of given ends to be discovered, not in the rejection of all ends, particularly those one creates. Moritz Schlick—whose thought we will consider in more detail later—claimed that Nietzsche saw that life has no meaning so long as it stands wholly under the domination of purposes. In Nietzsche's Zarathustra, "Sir Hazard," expressing Nietzsche's own considered view, says, "I have saved them from the slavery of ends." (Klemke, 3rd ed., 63).

Nietzsche sometimes spoke as if life, before he came into it, or before he revaluated all values, had no meaning: "Sombre is human life, and as yet without meaning: a buffoon may be fateful to it" (Thus Spake Zarathustra, 1883). There is no meaning "out there" to be discovered, no meaning in the essences of things, apart from human will, desire, perspective. In fact, apart from perspective, there is no world out there at all, no "thing-in-itself," no "facts-in-themselves." But a psychologically strong person can do without things in themselves and meaning (already there) to be discovered in them. That is because he can organize a small part of the world himself and thus create meaning. In The Will to Power, Nietzsche speaks of "the creative strength to create meaning," and he says:

It is a measure of the degree of strength of will to what extent one can do without meaning in things, to what extent one can endure to live in a meaningless world because one organizes a small portion of it oneself. (The Will to Power)

Whatever the meaning of life is, or is to be, it is terrestrial, not celestial. Meaning must not be placed in some fabricated "true world" but in this very earth in which we live and have our being. And the meaning of life is to be created, not discovered.

Still, somehow, man is not the meaning and measure of all things, though he has posited himself as such.

All the values by means of which we have tried so far to render the world estimable for ourselves and which then proved inapplicable and therefore devaluated the world—all these values are, psychologically considered, the results of certain perspectives of utility, designed to maintain and increase human constructs of domination—and they have been falsely projected into the essence of things. What we find here is still the hyperbolic naiveté of man: positing himself as the meaning and measure of the value of things. (The Will to Power)

The mistake lies in projecting our own values onto reality, in thinking that our meaning and values are present in things as such. But our meaning does not lie in "things-in-themselves." It is created by us. If we then give things out there such and such a meaning, we should recognize that it is not a meaning we have found in the things themselves, but rather one that we have given them.

We can still ask, What is the meaning of life? What is the meaning we shall give to life? Nietzsche gives two different answers. One is that the meaning of life is the Übermensch (sometimes translated as ‘Superman’), Nietzsche's post-human creator of meaning, affirmer of life, and bearer of values.

I want to teach men the sense of their existence, which is the Superman, the lightning out of the dark cloud—man. (Thus Spake Zarathustra)

The Superman is the meaning of the earth. Let your will say: The Superman SHALL BE the meaning of the earth! (Thus Spake Zarathustra)

The other answer is that the meaning of life is the will to power.

All meaning is will to power. (The Will to Power)

On the surface these two answers are different. But perhaps they are consistent. Perhaps what the will to power generates is the Superman, or what the Superman represents is the will to power. Again, perhaps the will to power is the meaning of life in the sense of its kernel or essence, while the Superman is its meaning in the sense of its end or goal.

Nietzsche's view has some aspects or consequences that should be noted. One consequence of Nietzsche's view is that the meaning of life is absent in the old and the sick. He acknowledged the fact. Another consequence (or perhaps component) of Nietzsche's view is that nihilism, the denial of all value, is a transitional stage, not the finale. Yet another consequence is that the meaning of life is not about the predominance of pleasure over pain. Concern with that evidences only nihilism. Finally, it may be conjectured that Nietzsche would probably regard with scorn those of us in the current debate among academic philosophers about the meaning of life. He would consider us "minute" philosophers:

The study of the minute philosophers is only interesting for the recognition that they have reached those stages in the great edifice of philosophy where learned disquisitions for and against, where hair-splitting objections and counter-objections are the rule: and for that reason they evade the demand of every great philosophy to speak sub specie aeternitatis. (Nietzsche, 1874)

d. Tolstoy

One of the next thinkers in the Western intellectual tradition to ask seriously the question, "What is the meaning of life?" was the great Russian novelist and moralist Count Leo Tolstoy (1828-1910). He asked the question and offered part of an answer in A Confession, written in Russian in 1879, circulated in 1882, and translated and published in 1884. Tolstoy's reflections on the question stimulated a great deal of subsequent debate on the issue.

Although characters in his earlier works, such as War and Peace, sometimes talked about the meaning of life and felt the problem deeply, Tolstoy himself raised serious questions about it only as part of a psychological crisis he underwent in the mid to late 1870s. Despite having everything anyone could ever want—wealth, fame, status, love, physical strength, and so forth—Tolstoy found himself severely disturbed. His symptoms were depression, psychological paralysis, obsession with suicide, and the continual recurrence in his head of the question of the meaning of life.

Tolstoy put his question about the meaning of life in several different ways. Here are some of them, listed in order of their occurrence in his Confession:

What is it for? What does it lead to? Why? What then? What for? But what does it matter to me? What of it? Why go on making any effort? How go on living? What will come of what I am doing today or shall do tomorrow? What will come of my whole life? Why should I live, why wish for anything, or do anything? Is there any meaning in my life that the inevitable death awaiting me does not destroy? What am  I, with my desires? Why do I live? What must I do? What is the meaning of my life? Why do I exist?

Several of these seem to be quite different questions, but Tolstoy regarded them all as the same question put in different ways.

Tolstoy said explicitly that his question was not about the composition, origin, and fate of the universe, nor again about the question, "What is the life of the whole?" That question, Tolstoy said, is unanswerable for a single man, and it is "stupidity" to think an individual must first answer the question about the meaning of the universe or the whole of humanity before he can answer the question of the meaning of his own life.

Tolstoy came to think that he should not expect to find the answers to his questions in philosophy. The legitimate task of philosophy is merely to ask the question and perhaps refine and clarify it, not to answer it, which it cannot do.

This view of philosophy as incapable of providing answers to the questions of life must have been one Tolstoy came to some way into his crisis. At another point, apparently earlier, Tolstoy did try to find answers in philosophy (as well as in the mathematical, physical, biological, and social sciences). The philosophers he studied were Socrates, the Buddha, "Solomon" (the author of Ecclesiastes), and Schopenhauer.

All of these he interpreted as providing a negative answer. The gist of Socrates' thought is that the true philosopher seeks death, because the life of the body, with all its ailments and desires, is an impediment to what he is really all about, namely, the quest for truth. The individual life of the physically discrete individual is pretty meaningless, something one would rather do without. The Buddha, as Tolstoy read him, teaches that life is the greatest of evils and works as hard as he can to free himself from it. "Solomon" teaches that it's all "vanity." And Schopenhauer, as Tolstoy understood him, wishes for, and advocates, annihilation.

In a nutshell, Tolstoy's problem was this: since I will suffer, die, be forgotten, and make no difference (leave no trace) in the long run, how does my life, or anything I do, have any meaning? It was a problem he felt deeply. He had to have an answer to go on living. Tolstoy's concern with the issue was not merely theoretical.

The solution to the problem that Tolstoy eventually came to was one he thought had been known all along by the unlearned peasants. The solution lies in a kind of irrational knowledge called "faith." Faith is faith in God, and lived faith involves some kind of relation to the Infinite. Meaning is found in the appropriate relationship to God, the Infinite. Tolstoy's solution bears obvious resemblances to Kierkegaard's and is very much in the same spirit.

Tolstoy spent the rest of his life working out the details of, or variations on, this solution. The progress of his thought can be traced in What I Believe and On Life, as well as in his late short fiction (The Death of Ivan Ilych, Father Sergius, and so forth). To the end Tolstoy held that faith in God, work, service to others, unselfishness, and love are essential parts of a meaningful life. He taught that the things ordinarily pursued by many—wealth, status, power, fame—contribute nothing to the meaningfulness of life.

e. Some Common Aspects of the Lives of Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, and Tolstoy

Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, and Tolstoy all had lives which rendered them virtual breeding grounds for problems with the meaning of life. (1) All of them were well off and did not have to work for a living; there is no evidence that any of them ever felt a real threat of, say, homelessness or starvation. Nietzsche was the one that wasn't exactly wealthy, but in his case his early retirement (in his late twenties) provided him with a pension for life sufficient to meet his material needs and free him up for a life of thought and writing. (2) All of them suffered from psychological illness of one sort or another—at the very least, a sense of gloom or melancholy, and in some cases a sense of worthlessness and a preoccupation with suicide, or feelings of dread and anxiety, or the encroachment of outright madness. (3) All of them grew up in religious environments, the tenets of which they lost faith in when they reached adulthood, and the lack of which they struggled with throughout their lives (eventually regaining, in the cases of Kierkegaard and Tolstoy, some portion of what they had lost). (4) None of them was a professional academician, except for Nietzsche in his youth.

From these four, and from our own experiences of life, we have inherited, to the extent that we have it, our preoccupation with the meaning of life.

3. Early Twentieth Century Continental Philosophers

In the early twentieth century questions about the meaning of life continued to be of interest to leading European or "Continental" philosophers.   

a. Heidegger

The great German philosophy professor Martin Heidegger (1889-1976) was certainly concerned with the meaning of life. He presented two different outlooks, which we may call "early Heidegger" and "later Heidegger.”

For early Heidegger (that is, the Heidegger of Being and Time, 1927), the question of the meaning of life is the question how we can live an "authentic" life, one that is our life, not just the life for us that has been fixed by the community we live in. His answer is that to live a meaningful life is to live a life of authenticity. To live a life authenticity is to live a life that one oneself chooses, not the life that is prescribed for one by one's social situation. To live a life of authenticity, one must have a plan, something that unifies one's life into an organic whole. This is one's own plan. So a meaningful life is one of focused authenticity. "Authenticity is Heidegger's accounted of what it is to live a meaningful life."

Living authentically, it turns out, is a matter of living in a way that is true to your heritage. "Being true to heritage is being true to your own, deepest self." In the end, the content of authenticity is not something you freely choose ex nihilo, but rather something you discover in the conjunction of heritage and facticity.

Early Heidegger's thought seems to be a kind of pantheism, and it is possible that Heidegger subscribed to some such view all his life.

Later Heidegger proposes a somewhat different view. In this philosophy of his, we are given the task, in which our meaning lies, of being "guardians of the world." The world is a holy place. To understand and appreciate that fact is to exhibit not just a certain intellectual and practical stance toward the world, but to live with an attitude of respect and reverence toward the world, toward the natural world especially. Later Heidegger saw exploitation of the natural world, as in mining and highway-building, as deplorable, as contrary to the very meaning of life. The meaning of life is guardianship of the world.

b. Sartre

The French philosopher Jean-Paul Sartre (1905-1980) changed his views over the course of his life. In his work Being and Nothingness (1943), advocated an outlook from which life is absurd. We more or less seriously pursue goals which, from a detached standpoint, we can see don't really matter. But we continue to act as though they do, and hence our lives are absurd. The Sartrean project is to overcome this detached standpoint, or to incorporate it into our lives.

The problem is other people. They insist on their own reality. They tend to get in the way of our pursuit of our own goals.

Later on, Sartre espoused a somewhat different view. On this new view, "our fundamental goal in life is to overcome our 'contingency'," to become the foundation of our own being. The main obstacle (again) is other people who, on the one hand, pursue their own (different) goals and, on the other, propose a real (military) threat to one's way of life and one's homeland.

In his 1944 play, No Exit, there is the famous line: "Hell is other people." Other people do not cooperate with my projects, and I do not cooperate with theirs. The result is war, in something like Schopenhauer's sense. People are always at war, or at least at odds, with each other.

In both his early and his later thought, Sartre ends up being pretty pessimistic and depressing. Life is meaningless. We can, by our free choice, give life some meaning or other. But the decision to do so is itself a matter of ungrounded free choice, which is such that it doesn't matter whether that decision or some other one is made.

c. Camus

Albert Camus (1913-1960), a Frenchman born in Algeria, was one of the leading existentialists (though he himself disowned the label) and one of the more influential writers of the first half of the twentieth century. He was familiar with the work of Nietzsche, and greatly influenced by it.

On our theme, Camus's starting point was the perception of the absurd. Human life, he felt, was absurd, meaningless, and senseless. The way in which it is, or the reason it is, lies in an inevitable clash between the needs and aspirations of human beings and the cold, meaningless world.

This clash has at least four facets. First, we seek—demand, even—a rational understanding of things, some way of seeing the world as familiar to us. But the world does not cooperate: to us, it is ultimately unintelligible. Second, we long for some kind of unity underlying and organizing the manifest diversity we find all around us. But again, the world is heedless of our longings. The world that presents itself to our senses is nothing but disjointed plurality. Third, we long for a higher reality (a God, for example), something transcendent, some cosmic meaning of everything. But no such meaning can be discerned. Fourth, we strive for continued life, or at least to achieve something permanent in the end. But our efforts are pointless, everything will come to nothing, and all that lies ahead is death and oblivion.

Our situation is like that of the mythical Greek of old, Sisyphus. We are condemned, as it were, to pushing a rock up a hill, over and over only to see it roll back down again, every time, when it reaches the top. Pointless labor is Sisyphus' lot, and ours too.

The pointlessness and absurdity of life raise the question of suicide. Should we kill ourselves? Camus's answer is that, no, we should not. Suicide is escapist. To kill yourself is to give in, to lose. If we were prisoners of war—which is something like what we are—our captor and tormentor would want us to do exactly that—confess that things are too much for us and kill ourselves. That would be his ultimate victory, which would bring him a chuckle, or perhaps even a hearty guffaw.

How then should we live? The first thing to do is to insist that life is better if there is no meaning. That would really irritate our tormentor. Second, we should cultivate a mindset of honesty and lucidity. We should not indulge in denial, or evasion, or imaginings of an eventual escape into an afterlife where everything will be put right. We should acknowledge that life is awful—but then, perhaps, add "and I love it" or "all is well." Third, we should take up an attitude of revolt, defiance, and scorn. Camus observes, "There is no fate that cannot be surmounted by scorn." Surely such an attitude would vex our hypothetical tormentor beyond measure. Fourth, we should live for now, stop worrying about the future, stop striving to achieve future goals. Nothing is going to come of anything we do in the long run anyway. Fifth, we should "use everything up": work hard, play hard, approach everything with zest and passion, expend energy to the human limit. This amounts to a kind of perverse "Yes!" to life. Finally, we may ask why anyone would want to live like this? Is it something that would appeal only to the French? What are the advantages of such an attitude toward life?

Camus has answers to these queries, three in fact. First, living as he recommends is a way of salvaging our dignity, and it is a way to which a certain majesty adheres. Second, surprisingly perhaps, such a way of living brings with it a "curious joy." Third, it is the way of freedom. Camus's scornful existentialism is the best conception we have of a truly free human being, one who does not allow himself to be shaped and determined by the mindless, meaningless world that surrounds him.

4. Early Twentieth Century Analytic, American, and English-Language Philosophers

 Anglo-American philosophers in the very late eighteenth and early twentieth centuries continued to be interested in problems of the meaning of life as well.

a. James

The American pragmatist philosopher William James (1842-1910), a Harvard professor, wrote a couple of interesting essays on our theme in the late 1890s. Both essays were written as addresses to be delivered to live audiences. They demand some discussion and consideration.

In "Is Life Worth Living?" (1895), James reveals deep, probably first-person, familiarity, with the existential source of concern with the issues of the meaning and worthwhileness of life. He calls it the "profounder bass-note of life" and suggests that it is to be found, or heard, somewhere in all of us: "In the deepest heart of all of us there is a corner in which the ultimate mystery of things works sadly." (1895: 32)

Some people are so naturally optimistic and in love with life that they are constitutionally incapable of being much bothered by the bass-note and pay it little attention. James's example of such a person is Walt Whitman; and one thinks of the English. James finds no fault—intellectual, moral, or otherwise—with such people. It is rare good fortune to be blessed with such a temperament. If everyone were, the question of the worthwhileness of life would never arise.

But for every Whitman, there is a suicide, and a thinker of the dreary constitution of the poet James Thomson, author of "The City of Dreadful Night."

In his address, James imagines himself in discussion with a would-be suicide whom he tries to persuade to take up his burden and see life through to its natural end. James acknowledges that some of these suicides—perhaps the majority of them—are too far gone to have anything said to them, for instance, those whose suicidal impulses are due to insanity or sudden fits of frenzy. It is to the class of reflective would-be suicides—those disposed to kill themselves because of their thinking, reading, and brooding on the darker side of life—that James directs his remarks. It is these he wants to cheer up (or comfort) and keep alive.

James speaks of two stages of recovery from suicidal illness. The first stage includes three elements, three palliatives, for the suicidal condition. First, there is the thought, "You can end it whenever you will." This strikes one as a strange thought to recommend to one contemplating suicide. But James thinks the thought can be a comfort. It means there's no particular guilt or stigma attached to suicide. It means one won't have to put up with this miserable world forever; one can opt out whenever one wants. It may delay the act by encouraging the thought, "Why kill myself today when I can always do it tomorrow?" Second, James points out, there is in human beings a natural sense of curiosity. It is worth hanging around a while longer in order to see the headlines of tomorrow's newspaper. Third, there is a certain fighting instinct in human beings. James thinks the normal man has a reason to go on, even if the whole thing is worthless and meaningless, as long as there is some injustice to be put right, some villain to be put down, or some evil to overcome in the little corner of the universe he inhabits. The three things just mentioned all lie in the first stage of recovery, one that is partial and inferior to what lies in the second stage.

The second stage is one of full recovery. It is the religious stage. It gives one assurance of a fully worthwhile and meaningful life.

James's injunction is to believe—to believe in a supernatural, spiritual order of things which overcomes and makes right the deficiencies of the natural order as we know it. We do not have rational or evidential proof that such a supernatural order exists. But Kant proved that natural science cannot prove that such an order does not exist. To make one's life worthwhile and meaningful, all one has to do is to posit faith in such an order, to believe that there is a spiritual realm in which all the wrongs of the natural order are righted. In that case, one will view the natural order as an inadequate representation of the spiritual, or as a veil through which the true and wonderful nature of the spiritual is hidden or obscured.

One need have little conception of what the spiritual realm is like. The content of the belief in it can be quite minimal. All one needs to affirm is that there is such a realm and that its reality makes life worthwhile. James draws on two of the tenets of his pragmatism to support such an approach to the meaning and worthwhileness of life.  One is the right to believe what we need to believe, even though it goes beyond belief warranted by empirical and rational evidence. His classic case for the right of such belief is in his essay, "The Will to Believe."

Another tenet of pragmatism on which James draws is the idea that belief is a matter of action. To believe something is not so much to have a certain mental state as to act in a certain way. Whatever is in one's mind, to act as though life is worthwhile and has meaning is to believe that it does

In "What Makes a Life Significant" (1899), James expressly addressed the question of the significance or meaning of life. What he said in this essay was rather different from what he had said in the previous one. The essay was in part a response to the deification of the uneducated, hard-working peasants in Tolstoy's Confession. James admired Tolstoy a great deal but felt he went a bit overboard in his praise of peasant life and in his tendency to identify it as the very locus of meaning. James held that the lives of Tolstoy's peasants were full of one ingredient necessary for a meaningful life—toil, struggle, pluck, will, suffering, manly virtues—but that they lacked the other necessary ingredient for a fully meaningful life, namely, what James called "ideals."

Toward the end of the essay, James gives his own view. He states it in two or three different ways, the sense of which seems to be the same. "[I]deal visions" must be backed "with what the laborers have, the sterner stuff of manly virtue."

[T]o redeem life from insignificance, [c]ulture and refinement all alone are not enough. . . . Ideal aspirations are not enough, when uncombined with pluck and will. . . . There must be some sort of fusion, some chemical combination among these principles, for a life objectively and thoroughly significant to result. (1899: 877)

The solid meaning of life is always the same eternal thing,—the marriage, namely, of some unhabitual ideal, however special, with some fidelity, courage, and endurance; with some man's or woman's pains.—And, whatever or wherever life may be, there will always be the chance for that marriage to take place. (1899: 878)

James is rather vague about what the "ideals" are, or even what they are like. In at least some cases they have something to do with culture and refinement, but it seems that they can and will vary from person to person, and may reside in some form in the uncultured and unrefined. In any event, it is noteworthy that James does not bring up the subject of religion. There is no suggestion that belief in God or a spiritual world is necessary for a fully meaningful life. An ideal wedded to manly virtue is enough.

b. Russell

The British philosopher Bertrand Russell (1872-1970) is often portrayed as one of those early twentieth century analytic philosophers who had no patience for big questions, such as that of the meaning of life. The portrayal is often reinforced by the famous story of Russell and the cab-driver, to whom Russell had nothing to say about the meaning of life.

It is true that Russell sometimes expressed a dismissive attitude toward the question: to Hugh Moorhead he said, "Unless you assume a God, the question (of life's meaning) is meaningless" (Metz 2013b: 23), and to the taxi-driver he had indeed nothing to say about the meaning of life. But elsewhere he seems to have taken the question very seriously.

In "A Free Man's Worship," he begins with a fairly gloomy, despairing picture of the world science reveals to us, the only world there is, really. It is purposeless, void of meaning. The causes that produced us had no prevision of the end they were achieving. We ourselves, and everything precious to us, are the outcome of the accidental collocations of atoms. There is no life for the individual beyond the grave. The existence of our very species, along with all its achievements, will eventually be extinguished in the death of the solar system and "buried beneath the debris of a universe in ruins."

But the thing for us to do is to maintain our ideals against the hostile universe. That universe knows the value of raw power, and not much else. Let us not worship it, as did Nietzsche. In exalting the will to power, Nietzsche was failing to maintain the highest human ideals in the face of the cruel world; he was, in a sense, giving in, capitulating, prostrately submitting to evil, sacrificing his best to Moloch.

Let us be clear-sighted and honest. Let us recognize that the facts are often bad, that in the world we know there are many things that would have been better otherwise, that our ideals are not in fact realized in the world.

But, again, in our minds and hearts, even though the whole business may be futile, let us tenaciously cling to our ideals, loving truth and beauty. Let us renounce power. Let us worship only the God created by our own love of the good. Let us live constantly in the vision of the good.

One trap we must guard against falling into is that which (Russell would think) Camus fell into some decades later. We should not cultivate and live in a spirit of fiery revolt, of fierce hatred of the senseless universe. Why not? Because indignation is still a kind of bondage, for it compels our thoughts to be occupied with the evil world. Give up the indignation so that your thoughts can be free. From freedom of thought comes art, philosophy, and the vision of beauty.

To achieve this we must develop a kind of detachment from our own personal happiness, must learn to free ourselves from the burden of concern for petty things and personal goods.

To abandon the struggle for private happiness, to expel all eagerness of temporary desire, to burn with passion for eternal things--this is emancipation, and this is the free man's worship. (Russell 1903: 61)

In The Conquest of Happiness Russell makes a couple of remarks about the meaning of life that are worthy of note. The first is this:

The habit of looking to the future and thinking that the whole meaning of the present lies in what it will bring forth is a pernicious one. There can be no value in the whole unless there is value in the parts. Life is not to be conceived on the analogy of a melodrama in which the hero and heroine go through incredible misfortunes for which they are compensated by a happy ending. (1930: 29)

The second is odd but interesting, perhaps not the kind of thought that would occur to most people:

the human heart as modern civilisation has made it is more prone to hatred than to friendship. And it is prone to hatred because it is dissatisfied, because it feels deeply, perhaps even unconsciously, that it has somehow missed the meaning of life, that perhaps others, but not we ourselves, have secured the good things which nature offers man's enjoyment. (1930: 75)

The thought seems to be that people hate each other because they think others have achieved (or know?) the meaning of life and they don't. If that is true, one should be careful not to let on that he knows the meaning of life, even if he does.

Several writers have advocated focus and have thought of a life organized by one big project or goal as the paradigm case of a meaningful one. Russell rejects the idea.

All our affections are at the mercy of death, which may strike down those whom we love at any moment. It is therefore necessary that our lives should not have that narrow intensity which puts the whole meaning and purpose of our life at the mercy of accident. For all these reasons the man who pursues happiness wisely will aim at the possession of a number of subsidiary interests in addition to those central ones upon which his life is built. (1930: 177)

Finally, in "The Place of Science in a Liberal Education," Russell makes the now familiar point that the meaning of life must come not from without but from within.

The search for an outside meaning that can compel an inner response must always be disappointed: all "meaning" must be at bottom related to our primary desires, and when they are extinct no miracle can restore to the world the value which they reflected upon it. (Mysticism and Logic, ch. 2, "The Place of Science in a Liberal Education")

That is not to say that the meaning of life is created or chosen as opposed to discovered. For our primary desires are something largely given, something (if we are lucky) we simply find in ourselves.

c. Schlick

Moritz Schlick (1882-1936) was one of the central figures of the logical positivist movement. Thinkers in the movement are commonly said to have been dismissive of such "metaphysical" questions as that of the meaning of life. Yet Schlick for one was in no way dismissive. He described himself as a seeker of the meaning of life and wrote an extremely interesting essay on the topic in 1927.

Schlick's contribution to the debate is (to some) one of the most appealing writings in the whole of the literature. Schlick was aware of Schopenhauer's musings and was concerned to escape his dire conclusions. Schlick found his answer in (his interpretation of) Nietzsche's Thus Spake Zarathustra. The answer is that life can be meaningful only if it is freed from its subjugation to ends and purposes. The suggestion is radical: a life has meaning only if it does not have some end or purpose to which everything is subordinated.

Schlick argued that the meaning of life is to be found not in work but in play. Work, in the philosophical sense, is always something done not for its own sake but for the sake of something else, some end or purpose that is to be achieved.  Most often that end is the survival and perpetuation of life—that is, more work functioning only to perpetuate the life of the species. But it is absurd to take the meaning of life to lie in the continued survival of the species, or in the work required to make that survival possible. The meaning of life must lie in the content of existence, not in bare existence as such.

What then is the meaning of life? One candidate that suggests itself is feelings of pleasure and happiness. But Schlick rejects that candidate, partly on the grounds that pleasure is likely only to lead to the satiety and boredom which Schopenhauer so vividly made us aware of. Schlick also rejects the ideal of happiness as the meaning of life by way of the observation that man is essentially an active creature for which a life of idle pleasure is by no means suitable. What Schlick ends up saying is that the meaning of life is to be found in play, that is, in activity engaged in for its own glorious sake and not for the furtherance of some further end or goal. Doing something only in order to produce some further end or goal is work, and work cannot be the meaning of life. Of course, work is necessary for human existence and thriving, but it is meaningful only if it can—and it can be—turned into play, something one would do with delight even if nothing came of it in the end.

Schlick backs off from saying that the meaning of life is play. Instead, he says that the meaning of life is youth, since youth is the period of life in which play predominates. A nice consequence of this position is the fact that a life cut short in its infancy or youth is a meaningful life. If you are killed when you are ten years old, it is likely that you lived a life full of meaning.

One other aspect of Schlick's view should be mentioned. It is that youth is not literally a matter of how long one has lived on this earth. If an old fellow turns his work into play, if he performs it primarily for the sake of the sheer joy of doing it, then he is young in the sense that matters. The key to a fully meaningful life would be to stay forever young.

d. Tagore

The Bengali Indian poet, short-story writer, novelist, dramatist, artist, sage, and philosopher Rabindranath Tagore (1861-1941), often credited with a major role in the cross-fertilization of East and West, won the Nobel Prize in literature in 1919. He wrote in English (sometimes). He knew the works of Einstein, Yeats, Wordsworth, and a host of other Western thinkers. In 1930 he delivered the Hibbert Lectures at Oxford, published the next year as The Religion of Man (1931), a remarkable volume containing much reflection on the meaning of life. This article will limit itself to consideration of a couple of points in that book.

Tagore is interesting because his interest in the question of the meaning of life did not arise out of anything like the circumstances which seemed to create the interest in so many Western thinkers. Tagore was not well-off and bored, he did not suffer from depression and existential angst, he did not worry about the importance of his personal life in the vast scheme of things, he was not a professional academic philosopher.

Tagore's tendency was to view the question of the meaning of life as the question, "What is man?" or "What am I?" His answer seems to have been that the true human is the universal self, or the true Man represented by the life of the species, or even by the life of all beings.

If he had a problem, it lay in the chaotic, hodgepodge nature of this everyday life. Not exactly seeking for a solution to the predicament, one came to him on an ordinary day on which he was just living his everyday life in east India. He gives a gripping and poetic account of it in chapter six of The Religion of Man. He writes:

Suddenly I became conscious of a stirring of soul within me. My world of experience in a moment seemed to become lighted, and the facts that were detached and dim found a great unity of meaning. The feeling which I had was like that which a man, groping through a fog without knowing his destination, might fee when he suddenly discovers that he stands before his own house. (Tagore 1931, 95)

One thing that is noteworthy in this is that Tagore felt he had seen the meaning of life, not when he realized that his life really mattered, or added up to something sub specie aeternitatus, nor when he came up with a view of things that rid him of his angst and depression, but rather when he found that his life was part of a great unity of meaning. He saw meaning when everything, including his individual life, was one unified whole.

A second feature of Tagore's conception of the meaning of life is the role he gives to detachment. The detachment that is relevant seems to be something like non-attachment to the petty concerns of one's own individual life. It is not a lack of concern for anything and everything. It is lack of concern for how one's own individual, personal life fares. The appropriately detached person places his interest in how Man as the eternal being, or beings of any sort ultimately fare. (There is an admirable concern for all life, not just human life in the thought of Tagore.) The appropriately detached man loses concern for his personal triumphs and failures and cultivates an enlivening interest in the life of the whole, with which, instead of his personal life, he identifies himself. The result is a vast increase in the sense of meaningfulness in his own life.

e. Ayer

A very different approach to the problem of the meaning of life was taken by the prominent logical positivist English philosopher A. J. Ayer (1910-1989).

Ayer argued, in an important 1947 paper, that "there is no sense in asking what is the ultimate purpose of our existence, or what is the real meaning of life" (Ayer 1947: 201). His argument is that there is no reason to believe in anything like a God who created us and intended us for a specific purpose. And even if there were such a God, his purposes could not give life meaning unless we agreed with them and accepted them. Thus the meaning of life always comes back to what we as individuals purpose, value, and aim at. There is no meaning out there to be discovered.

Ayer insists that the meaninglessness of life is nothing to cry about. One's life has whatever meaning one gives it. It just doesn't make sense to ask about the meaning of life because there is not, and could not be, such a thing. The question "What is the meaning of life?" is illogical and unanswerable. But a person can give his life a meaning, and if he does, it will be meaningful to him. It will come down to the value judgments the person makes. And these are a matter of personal choice and preference. There is no sense in saying that one person's value judgments are true and another's false. Give your life a meaning, and that's the meaning it will have.

5. Conclusion

The dismissal of the question about the meaning of life which was characteristic of Ayer and his generation, and Camus's idea that meaninglessness doesn't matter, may be what ironically sparked the recent interest in the question. The natural philosophical response is that surely the question of the meaning of life is meaningful and important: in light of the remarks of Ayer, Camus, and their ilk, how is that so? A sense that the meaning of life must be a philosophical problem that matters has motivated work on the question of what the question of the meaning of life is all about, if we do not take Ayer's dismissive attitude and Camus's stance toward it. The work of Richard Taylor, Robert Nozick, Thomas Nagel, Joel Feinberg, Harry Frankfurt, Susan Wolf, Thaddeus Metz, Joshua Seachris, Julian Young, John Cottingham, David Benatar, and Garrett Thomson (among others) are attempts to answer this question.

The preceding survey brings us up to around 1950, just before a veritable explosion of works on the meaning of life took place in philosophy, especially in the Anglo-analytic tradition. Those interested in this explosion should begin by consulting the excellent overviews in Thaddeus Metz's article in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Metz 2013) and Joshua Seachris's article in The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Seachris 2012)

6. References and Further Reading

  • Ayer, A. J. “The Claims of Philosophy.” Reprinted in The Meaning of Life, 3rd Ed.. E. D. Klemke (ed.). New York: Oxford University Press, 2008: 199-202. (Originally published in 1947)
  • Baier, K. "The Meaning of Life." Reprinted in The Meaning of Life. E. D. Klemke (ed.). New York: Oxford University Press, 1981: 81-117. (Originally published in 1947.)
  • Camus, A. "The Myth of Sisyphus." J. O'Brien (tr.). Reprinted in part in Ways of Wisdom: Readings on the Good Life, Steve Smith (ed.). Lanham, MD: University Press of America, 1983: 244-255. (Originally published in French in 1943.)
  • Carlyle, T. 1834. Fraser's Magazine. available online at Project Gutenberg.
  • Heidegger, M. Being and Time. J. Macquarrie and J. Robinson (trs.). Oxford: Blackwell, 1973. (Originally published in German in 1927.)
  • James, W. "Is Life Worth Living?.” in The Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy, New York: Dover Publications, 1956: 32-62. (Originally published in 1895.)
  • James, W. “What Makes a Life Significant?.” in On Some of Life's Ideals. New York: Henry Holt and Company, 1899: 49–94. Reprinted in William James: Writings 1878-1899. New York: The Library of America, 1992: 861-80.
  • Kierkegaard, S. Concluding Unscientific Postscript. (Available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally published in Danish in 1846.)
  • Kierkegaard, S. Either/Or: A Fragment of Life. (Available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally published in Danish in 1843.)
  • Klemke, E. D. (ed.). The Meaning of Life. New York: Oxford University Press, 1981.
  • Klemke, E. D. (ed.). The Meaning of Life. 2nd Ed. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Klemke, E. D. & Cahn, S. (eds.). The Meaning of Life: A Reader, 3rd Ed. New York: Oxford University Press, 2008.
  • Metz, T. "The Meaning of Life.” The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2013 Edition). Edward N. Zalta (ed.).
  • Nagel, T. "The Absurd," Reprinted in The Meaning of Life. E. D. Klemke (ed.). New York: Oxford University Press, 1981: 151-161. (Originally published in 1971.)
  • Nietzsche, F. Ecce Homo. (available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally written in German in 1888-1889.)
  • Nietzsche, F. On the Genealogy of Morals. Ian Johnston (tr.). 2009.
  • Nietzsche, F. Thus Spake Zarathustra. (available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally written in German in 1883-1885.)
  • Nietzsche, F. Twilight of the Idols. (available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally written in German in 1888-1899.)
  • Nietzsche, F. The Will to Power. (available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally published in German in 1901-1911.)
  • The Oxford English Dictionary. Oxford: Oxford University Press: 2014.
  • Russell, B. "A Free Man's Worship.” Reprinted in The Meaning of Life. E. D. Klemke (ed.). New York: Oxford University Press, 1981: 55-62. (Originally published in 1903.)
  • Russell, B. The Conquest of Happiness. London: Liveright, 1930.
  • Sartre, J. P. Being and Nothingness. H. E. Barnes (tr.). New York: Philosophical Library, 1956. (Originally published in French in 1943.)
  • Sartre, J. P. "Existentialism and Humanism." B. Frechtman (tr.). 1956. Reprinted in Ways of Wisdom. S. Smith (ed.). Lanham, MD: University Press of America, 1983: 234-43.
  • Schlick, M. 1927. "On the Meaning of Life.” Reprinted in The Meaning of Life: A Reader, 3rd Ed., E. D. Klemke & S. Cahn (eds.). P. Heath (tr.). New York: Oxford University Press, 2008: 62-71. (Originally published in 1927.)
  • Schopenhauer, A. 1840. On the Basis of Morality. (available free online and in several editions)
  • Schopenhauer, A. "On the Suffering of the World.” in Essays and Aphorisms. R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). New York: Penguin Books, 1970: 41-50. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
  • Schopenhauer, A. "On the Vanity of Existence.” in Essays and Aphorisms. R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). New York: Penguin Books, 1970: 51-54. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
  • Schopenhauer, A. "On Affirmation and Denial of the Will to Live.” in Essays and Aphorism., R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). New York: Penguin Books, 1970: 61-65. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
  • Schopenhauer, A. "On Suicide.” in Essays and Aphorisms. R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). New York: Penguin Books, 1970: 77-79. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
  • Schopenhauer, A. The Essays of Arthur Schopenhauer: The Wisdom of Life. T. B. Saunders (tr.). 1860. rpr. in The Project Gutenberg EBook of The Essays of Arthur Schopenhauer, 2004.
  • Schopenhauer, A. The Essays of Arthur Schopenhauer: On Human Nature. T. B. Saunders (tr.). 1860. Reprinted in The Project Gutenberg EBook of The Essays of Arthur Schopenhauer, 2004,
  • Schopenhauer, A. The World as Will and Representation. 2 Vols. E. F. J. Payne (tr.). 1969. New York: Dover Publications. (Vol. 1 first appeared in 1818, Vol. 2 in 1844, in German.)
  • Schopenhauer, A. Essays and Aphorisms, R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). 1970. New York: Penguin Books. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
  • Seachris, J., 2012, "Meaning of Life: The Analytic Perspective,” The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy,
  • Smith, S., (ed.), 1983, Ways of Wisdom: Readings on the Good Life, Lanham, MD: University Press of America.
  • Tagore, R., 1961, The Religion of Man, London: George Allen & Unwin Co., Reprinted Boston: Beacon Press. (Originally published in 1930.)
  • Taylor, R., 1970, "The Meaning of Life," Reprinted in The Meaning of Life, E. D. Klemke (ed.), New York: Oxford University Press, 1981: 141-150.
  • Tolstoy, L., 2005, A Confession, Aylmer Maude (tr.), Reprinted Mineola, NY: Dover Publications. (Originally published in 1884.)
  • Young, J. 2014, The Death of God and the Meaning of Life, 2nd ed., New York & London: Routledge.


Author Information

Wendell O'Brien
Morehead State University
U. S. A.


Desert is a normative concept that is used in day-to-day life.  Many believe that being treated as one deserves to be treated is a matter of justice, fairness, or rightness.  Although desert claims come in a variety of forms, generally they are claims about some positive or negative treatment that someone or something ought to receive.  One might claim that a hard-working employee deserves a raise, an exceptional student deserves an academic scholarship, a dishonest politician deserves to lose an election, or a thief deserves to be imprisoned.  But while such appeals to desert are common, there are a number of unsettled issues regarding the concept of desert itself and its relevance to justice.  For example, it is common for people to claim that things other than humans, such as nonhuman animals or inanimate objects, can be deserving.  How should we assess such claims?  Some argue that desert presupposes responsibility.  But must this be the case?  According to some theories, desert is an important component of justice.  Yet according to other theories, it has little or no role in justice.  Some even question whether desert itself is a defensible concept.  This article is designed to capture the scholarly agreement about these and other issues regarding desert.  Where there is not such agreement, overviews of some of the competing accounts are presented.

Table of Contents

  1. The Structure of Desert
    1. Deserving Subjects
    2. Deserved Modes of Treatment
    3. Desert Bases
      1. Desert and Responsibility
      2. Desert and Time
  2. Desert and Some Related Concepts
    1. Merit
    2. Entitlement
  3. The Role of Desert in Justice
    1. Desert in Distributive and Retributive Justice
    2. Desert, Institutions, and Justice
  4. Meritocracy
  5. Some Arguments against Desert
    1. Rawls’s Metaphysical Argument
    2. The Epistemological and Pragmatic Arguments
    3. Libertarian Arguments
  6. Concluding Remarks
  7. References and Further Reading

1. The Structure of Desert

It is widely held that desert is a relation among three elements: a subject, a mode of treatment or state of affairs deserved by the subject, and some fact or facts about the subject, which are often referred to as desert base or desert bases (McLeod 1999a, 61-62; Pojman 2006, 21; Sher 1987, 7).  This relation is shown in the formula:

S deserves M in virtue of B,

where S is the subject, M is the mode of treatment, and B is the desert base or bases. Each of these elements will be examined in greater detail.

a. Deserving Subjects

One’s view about who or what are the appropriate subjects of desert is going to be influenced by one’s view about what desert requires on the part of a subject.  If one thinks that merely having a quality or feature is sufficient to establish desert, then one will place few restrictions on the kinds of things that can be deserving.  If one thinks that having some baseline self-awareness is sufficient to make one the appropriate subject of desert, then nonhuman animals such as bottlenose dolphins and chimpanzees can be appropriate bearers of desert.  If one thinks that desert requires a certain level of responsibility, then one will advocate for a conception that places stricter limits on who or what qualify as deserving subjects.  While there is some disagreement in the literature, most who theorize about desert view human beings, or at least some subset of human beings, as appropriate subjects of desert  A very broad conception of desert might seek to extend the concept to apply to certain or all sentient creatures, living things in general, or even inanimate objects.  In fact, common language usage seems to support such a broad understanding.  One might claim that Gone with the Wind deserves its reputation as one of the greatest movies ever made or that K2 deserves its reputation as one of the most difficult mountains to climb.  But such a broad understanding of desert might involve problematic conflations of desert with other concepts.  For example, while one might think Gone with the Wind’s lofty reputation is appropriate, one might argue that, strictly speaking, its reputation is not deserved.  Instead, one might argue that in the cases of movies, mountains, and the like, the proposed desert claims are best understood as nothing more than general claims about how something should be judged or about what something should have or receive.  So, in an effort to maintain conceptual clarity, it might be best to attribute some common uses of the term ‘desert’ to inexact language usage.  A survey of the literature suggests some support for both broader (Schmidtz 2002, 777) and narrower uses of the term (Miller 1999, 137-138).

b. Deserved Modes of Treatment

Subjects are said to deserve a wide variety of things.  The modes of treatment or states of affairs that one can deserve can be classified as positive or negative outcomes, harms or benefits, or gains or losses (Kristjánsson 2003, 41).  Positive modes of treatment include such things as awards, compensation, good luck, jobs, praise, prizes, remuneration, rewards, and success.  Negative modes of treatment include such things as bad luck, blame, censure, failure, fines, and punishment.  Oftentimes, a deserved mode of treatment will incorporate a source or supplier of that treatment.  For example, one might argue that an athlete deserves praise from his manager.  But such a source need not be specified in all cases since legitimate desert claims need not be directed toward any source.  This is, in part, because legitimate desert claims need not be enforceable or even prescribe any action.  Consider the claim that certain hardworking people deserve good fortune.  While this is a legitimate desert claim, it need not be directed toward any source and it need not result in a call for any corrective action in cases in which particular hardworking people have not had good fortune (Kekes 1997, 124).

c. Desert Bases

There are a variety of ways in which desert bases can be categorized.  Two categories that are commonly used in the philosophical literature are desert based on effort and desert based on performance.  Some accounts of desert focus primarily on one’s effort toward achieving some goal.  Usually the goal has to be viewed as worthwhile, since quixotic effort is rarely considered to be a basis for desert.  Some argue that desert is not based solely, or even primarily, on effort, but also on one’s performance in a given context.  The performance can be any number of activities that give rise to positive or negative evaluation, such as the winning of a race or performing poorly in a music competition.  In some contexts, the performance can be assessed in terms of the contribution that one makes as a part of some group, such as a family, company, community, or even a society as a whole.  Depending on the context, this contribution can be measured in terms of productivity, success, or some other similar measure. Michael Boylan presents a thought experiment that raises questions concerning how one’s effort and performance often are, and how they should be weighed as factors in determining one’s desert.  We are presented with two puzzle makers.  The first puzzle maker is presented with a puzzle that is 80 percent complete, and he finishes the puzzle by completing the remaining 20 percent.  The second puzzle maker is presented with a puzzle that is totally incomplete.  He manages to complete 80 percent of the puzzle, and therefore does not finish it (2004, p. 139 ff). Boylan notes that, according to a common interpretation, the first puzzle maker would be the one who deserves the credit, and the resultant spoils, for completing the puzzle.  But why should this puzzle maker get more credit when he completed significantly less of the puzzle?  He cannot claim credit for, and therefore cannot claim to deserve, receiving the puzzle in a more advanced stage of completion, since he did nothing to bring the puzzle to that stage of completion. The puzzle maker example highlights important issues regarding the nature and use of desert.  First, there is the question of what basis or bases one should use to determine desert.  Should effort, performance, or some combination of the two be used?  Are there other criteria that ought to be used?  Second, even if one determines that effort and performance are the relevant desert bases, then one must still determine how to correctly weigh the two in a given situation.

i. Desert and Responsibility

As noted above, one’s view about who or what can qualify as a deserving subject will be influenced by one’s view of the role of responsibility in establishing desert.  Some have argued that at least some type of responsibility is a necessary condition for all desert (Smilansky 1996a, 1996b), whereas others have argued that, in at least some cases, one can deserve some mode of treatment without anyone being responsible for the desert base that gives rise to that mode of treatment (Feldman 1995, 1996).  An example of responsibility without desert could be cases in which a victim of theft is said to deserve compensation even though he was not responsible for having his money stolen.  In such a case, however, there is still someone, namely the thief, who is responsible for the desert base.  Others might offer desert claims based on suffering that people endure at the hands of beings with dubious levels of responsibility, such as children, mentally handicapped or emotionally disturbed adults, and nonhuman animals.  Some argue that there can be desert in cases in which the suffering is not caused by any being, such as when people suffer as the result of a natural phenomenon.  One who supports this view might argue that a tornado victim can deserve financial support as a result of his suffering through that natural disaster. So, one can argue that while certain cases of desert require responsibility, not all do.  In at least some cases, one can attempt to maintain a connection between desert and responsibility by appealing to a notion of negative responsibility.  That is, one can argue that if someone suffers a misfortune for which she is not responsible, and this misfortune causes her to fall below some baseline condition, then she can deserve some treatment as a result of her suffering (Smilansky 1996a, 1996b).  Alternatively, one could argue that cases like those of the crime and tornado victims are not cases of genuine desert.  One might argue that in situations in which a person suffers through no fault of her own she might be due compensation, and while it is a matter of justice whether she receives compensation, strictly speaking she does not deserve compensation.

ii. Desert and Time

Most desert theorists argue that desert is strictly a backward-looking concept.  According to this standard view, a person’s desert is based strictly on past and present facts about him (Rachels 1997, 176; Feinberg 1970, 72; Miller 1976, 93).  The view that desert must be backward looking has been challenged, however.  According to these alternative, forward-looking accounts, certain legitimate desert claims can be based on future performances (Feldman 1995, Schmidtz 2002).  This forward-looking view has been questioned based in part on a concern that it relies on instances of desert without legitimately grounded desert bases.  The argument is that in order for a person to deserve something at a given time there must be some relevant fact about the person at that time that gives rise to his desert.  The concern is that a desert base with sufficient grounding conditions that lie in the future cannot be such a fact, for it is metaphysically dubious (Celello 2009, 156).

2. Desert and Some Related Concepts

Desert is one of many concepts that are used to assess the appropriateness of what one does or should have.  Prior to discussing the role of desert in justice, it is worthwhile to consider a couple of these other concepts.

a. Merit

There is not a consensus on how to understand the relationship between desert and merit.  Some argue that the terms ‘desert’ and ‘merit’ do not identify separate concepts.  And, in ordinary language, the two are often used interchangeably (McLeod 1999a, 67).  But many scholars have offered important distinctions between the two concepts.  One way to distinguish between the two is to claim that merit should understood more broadly than desert, since merit results from any quality or feature of a subject that serves as a basis for the positive or negative treatment of that subject even if that treatment is not strictly speaking deserved.  On this account, desert is a species of the genus merit (Pojman 1997, 22-23).  Although scholars discuss other distinguishing factors, e.g. effort and intention, a main factor used to distinguish desert from merit is responsibility.  David Miller claims that a distinction between desert and merit is supported by the ways in which the two are discussed in contemporary discourse (1999, 125).  He notes that ‘merit’ is used to refer to a person’s admirable qualities whereas ‘desert’ is used in cases in which someone is responsible for a particular result.  One who supports such a distinction might claim that a person can merit treatment based on factors over which he has little or no control, based on characteristics that he did little to develop, and based on performances that required very little effort.  For example, a man can merit, but not deserve, admiration for his native good looks.  In addition, since merit does not require responsibility, it can apply to a wide variety of things, including nonhuman animals and even inanimate objects.

b. Entitlement

Understood in one way, entitlement claims are specific to particular associations, organizations, or institutions.  Entitlement results from a subject having a claim or right to some treatment as a result of following the rules or meeting some explicit criterion or criteria of an association, organization, or institution.  Although certain entitlements might be related to or give rise to desert (McLeod 1999b, 192), it is important to keep the two concepts distinct.  There are many situations in which one deserves some treatment without being entitled to that treatment or in which one is entitled to something that one does not also deserve.  Consider an automobile race in which the leading driver is caused to wreck by debris on the track.  As a result, he crashes just prior to crossing the finish line.  In such races, crossing the finish line first is the criterion used to establish the winner.  If the crash prevented the driver from winning, one could reasonably argue that, although the driver is not entitled to win, he deserved to win because he had made the requisite effort, performed better than all of the other drivers for the entire race leading up to the crash, and was clearly going to win before he crashed.  In addition to the fact that one can deserve something that one is not entitled to, one can be entitled to something that one does not deserve.  Based on the laws of his country, an evil dictator could be entitled to a subject’s property that the dictator seized on a whim, but this does not mean that the dictator deserves the property.  To use another common example, a son might be entitled to an inheritance left to him by his father, but he might not have done anything to deserve that inheritance.

3. The Role of Desert in Justice

In a general sense, justice can be understood to consist in persons getting what is appropriate or fitting for them.  This idea of justice can be traced back to ancient times.  Plato discussed justice in general, and distributive justice in particular, as involving a type of appropriateness or fittingness of treatment (Republic 1.332bc).  According to some translations of Laws, Plato suggested that justice involves treating people as they deserve to be treated (6.757cd). Although there are many important differences between their theories, Aristotle joined Plato by arguing that justice involves a type of equality.  In Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle maintained that distributive justice involves judging people according to certain criteria in order to determine whether they are equal or unequal.  He argued that, in distributions, it is just for equals to receive equal shares, unjust for equals to receive unequal shares, and unjust for those who are unequal to receive equal shares.  He maintained that what each person receives should be geometrically proportional to the degree or extent to which his or her actions fit or match these criteria (5.3.1131a10-b16).  People are judged based on normative concepts such as desert, merit, and entitlement to determine whether they are equal or unequal.  Consider a distributive context in which two people are to be treated based on what each deserves.  According to the idea of geometrical proportionality, if one person is twice as deserving as the other, then she ought to receive twice the share of what is to be distributed. According to the classical tradition, desert is one of the conceptual components of justice.  But it is not understood as being the only conceptual component of justice.  The Greek word axia, a word used by both Plato and Aristotle in their discussions of the distribution of things such as goods, honors, and services, can be translated as, or understood to include, “desert”.  But, in certain contexts, it might be misleading to translate axia as ‘desert’ instead of translating it as ‘merit’ or some other related concept (Miller 1999, 125-126). Desert has a prominent role in certain more recent conceptions of justice, such as those of John Stuart Mill and Henry Sidgwick.  In Utilitarianism, Mill claimed that it is considered just when a person gets whatever good or evil he deserves and unjust when he receives a good or suffers an evil that he does not deserve (2001, 45).  Sidgwick argued that justice involved one’s desert being requited (1907, 280 ff).  According to some contemporary theories of justice, often referred to as “pluralist” theories, desert is one among other important conceptual components of justice.  These other components can include, but need not be limited to, entitlement, equality, merit, need, reciprocity, and moral worth.  According to these theories, whether and to what extent desert is relevant to justice depends on the context in which the judgment is being made.  And, when desert conflicts with the other components of justice, it must be measured against them in order to determine what justice requires (Miller 1999, 133; Schmidtz 2006, 4).

a. Desert in Distributive and Retributive Justice

Some scholars argue that desert’s role in distributive justice and retributive justice is symmetrical, i.e., that desert is more or less equally relevant in both (Sher 1987; Pojman 2006, 126).  There is disagreement in the literature as to whether desert’s role ought to be understood in this way (Moriarty 2003; Smilansky 2006).  Those who argue in favor of an asymmetry in desert’s role may attempt to explain the asymmetry in different ways.  Some might argue that desert is relevant in retributive justice but not in distributive justice because being the appropriate recipient of a harm requires a level of responsibility that being the appropriate recipient of a benefit does not.  Or, some might argue in favor of the asymmetry based on the differing modes of treatment that are called for in distributive and retributive contexts.  The motivating idea used to support this view is that desert is an appropriate and important basis for punishment, but other concepts, e.g. equality and need, are the appropriate bases for distributions of goods and services.  Even if one recognizes desert as an important conceptual component of both distributive and retributive justice, one might argue that desert differs in these different spheres.  For example, one might argue that desert in distributive justice can be forward looking, while desert in retributive justice cannot (Feldman 1995, 74-76; Schmidtz 2002, 783-784).

b. Desert, Institutions, and Justice

In many cases, what one is said to deserve is connected to a certain convention or practice within an association, organization, or larger social institution.  One cannot deserve first place in an automobile race if there are not any such competitions, nor can an employee at a steel mill deserve a raise absent the existence of the steel mill and the economic system of which the steel mill is some very small part.  In the light of such examples, some scholars claim that, if it is a defensible concept at all, desert cannot exist in the absence of such institutional conventions or practices (Cummiskey 1987).  This idea leads some scholars to offer what they view as an important distinction between pre-institutional desert (p-desert) and institutional desert (i-desert). Those who recognize p-desert argue that although specific desert bases or deserved modes of treatment are often defined within a particular associational, organizational, or institutional context, desert is a concept that is logically prior to and independent of both tacit and explicit institutional criteria and rules.  They argue that the conflation of p-desert with i-desert is based on a failure to recognize the distinction between desert as a general normative concept and a particular type of desert that is influenced by institutions.  According to this view, the distinction between p-desert and i-desert is based on an important difference between one deserving something regardless of whether one is a part of an institution and deserving a specific thing based mostly or wholly on institutional criteria or rules.  The reason why someone deserves a specific trophy made of a specific material for his effort and performance toward winning a particular automobile race is because there is an institution that holds and regulates such an event.  But the underlying reason why the person deserves something for winning the automobile race is that, pre-institutionally, effort and performance give rise to desert. Some argue that rejecting p-desert is problematic since, without it, there is no independent normative concept of desert.  That is, there is no concept of desert that is external to any given institution which can be used to evaluate the justice of institutions.  Another difficulty with the rejection of p-desert is that it would disallow the seemingly reasonable claim that a person can deserve something even if she is not a part of any identifiable institution.  One could argue that a person could deserve something in a state of nature or that she could deserve something even if she were the last person on Earth.  If she were to work hard to build a shelter and grow crops, for example, one could argue that she thereby deserves the benefits that resulted from those activities. Some who argue that John Rawls’s theory of justice as fairness allows for desert in distributive contexts interpret his theory as advancing a purely institutional conception of desert.  Samuel Scheffler (2000) argues that Rawls rejects prejusticial desert and not pre-institutional desert, however.  According to Scheffler, Rawls rejects prejusticial desert because Rawls thinks that desert can exist only after the principles of justice have been established.  Scheffler interprets Rawls as arguing that a person deserves whatever it is that justice dictates he should receive and only what justice dictates he should receive.  On this view, desert is not prejusticial since desert is defined in terms of justice as opposed to justice being defined, at least in part, in terms of desert.  But justice is understood as being pre-institutional since justice is a normative concept, external to any particular institution, which can be used to judge institutions.  The rejection of prejusticial desert will be viewed as problematic by those who, following more traditional conceptions of justice, define justice, at least in part, in terms of desert.  The concern is that defining desert in terms of justice, instead of defining justice in terms of desert, results in a backward understanding of the relationship between the two concepts.

4. Meritocracy

In general, a meritocracy is a social system in which advancement, reward, and status are based on individual abilities and talents.  In theory, those who are more able and talented would advance further, reap greater rewards, and achieve loftier status.  Meritocracy can involve attempting to erect a basic structure of society according to the ideas of a meritocracy or it can involve attempting to implement a system in which a society’s basic institutions are governed, at least in part, by principles of awarding jobs and specifying rewards for jobs on the basis of merit.  Although the two issues are sometimes conflated, Norman Daniels notes that whether someone merits a job is separate from what rewards are attached to that job.  So, while a person might merit a particular job of great importance, one should not assume that he merits higher wages or greater rewards than another person who merits a job of much less importance (Daniels, 218-219). As discussed above, there is some scholarly disagreement about the relationship between merit and desert.  For those who offer clear distinctions between the two, a social system in which advancement, reward, and status were based on desert would be different from one in which such benefits were based on merit.  A system of merit would be based on persons’ abilities and talents, whereas a system based on desert would focus on persons’ efforts and performances for which they are responsible.  As a result, although the creation of either would be difficult, the creation of a system based on desert, a “desertocracy” if you will, seems to be more problematic than one based on merit.  This is because a desertocracy would seem to require more, and more specific, information about persons than would a meritocracy.

5. Some Arguments against Desert

While many consider desert to be an important conceptual component of justice, others have argued against this view.  Some argue that the concept of desert itself is problematic.  This is known as the metaphysical argument against desert.  Others claim that, even if desert is a defensible concept, determining what people deserve or treating people according to what they deserve is not feasible.  These ideas are defended in the epistemological and pragmatic arguments against desert.  Some maintain that, regardless of the force of the metaphysical, epistemological, or pragmatic arguments, desert does not have a prominent role in distributive justice.  Examples of this view can be found in right- and left-libertarian theories of justice.

a. Rawls’s Metaphysical Argument

Among the contemporary theories of justice in which desert does not have a prominent role, John Rawls’s is the most often discussed.  Drawing from Herbert Spiegelberg’s (1944, 113) idea that the inequalities of birth are types of underserved discrimination, Rawls (1971, 104) claims that desert does not apply to one’s place in the distribution of native endowments, one’s initial starting place in society, i.e. the familial and social circumstances into which one is born, or to the superior character that enables one to put forth the effort to develop one’s abilities.  As is often the case with Rawls’s work, as evidenced by the discussion of pre-institutional and prejusticial desert above, there are many competing interpretations of his views on the relationship between desert and justice.  Yet, regardless of which of these interpretations is correct, Rawls work suggests a metaphysical argument against desert. According to this metaphysical argument, since most of who we are and what we do is greatly influenced by undeserved native endowments and by the undeserved circumstances into which we are born, one cannot deserve anything, or, at best, one can deserve very little.  According to a common interpretation, Rawls believes that desert should not have any role in distributive justice, since these undeserved factors have a major influence on all would-be desert bases (Sher 1987, 22 ff).  Others contend that Rawls does allow for some limited amount of desert (Moriarty 2002, 136-137).  Regardless of whether Rawls does allow for some limited amount of desert, if sound, the metaphysical argument against desert would either substantially or completely undermine the concept.

b. The Epistemological and Pragmatic Arguments

David Hume was an early critic of those theories of distributive justice in which merit was assigned a prominent role.  Although, as discussed above, there are differences between the concepts of desert and merit, and although Hume’s use of  the term ‘merit’ differs from more modern uses, the kinds of arguments that Hume offered against merit are often used against desert in contemporary discussions.  Hume argued that since humans are both fallible in their knowledge of the factors that would establish others’ merit and prone to overestimating their own merit, distributive schemes based on merit could not result in determinate rules of conduct and would be utterly destructive to society (Hume, 27).  This thinking is captured in the epistemological and pragmatic arguments against desert. According to the epistemological argument, since we cannot know the specific details of the lives of every member in a community or society, we cannot accurately treat people according to their desert.  Recall that effort and performance are commonly cited as appropriate desert bases.  Even if one agrees that only effort and performance should be used to determine one’s desert, concerns about how such determinations could be made with any accuracy or consistency still remain.  How could one know how much of a person’s performance was the result of effort as opposed to natural talent, brute luck, or any other number of complicating factors?  The pragmatic argument against desert is that, regardless of whether we could gain the knowledge needed to treat people according to their desert accurately, attempting to do so would have overriding negative consequences.  Such negative consequences could include expending large amounts of time and resources in an effort to make accurate desert judgments and, perhaps, losses of personal privacy as one delves into the details of others’ lives. Both the epistemological and pragmatic arguments must be accounted for when attempting to explain how a true meritocracy could and should be arranged.  Those who do not advocate meritocracies on a large scale might overcome the difficulties suggested by the epistemological and pragmatic arguments by maintaining that the use of desert should be limited to smaller, local contexts.  According to this view, since it is easier to determine a person’s desert in contexts that are limited in size and scope, accurate desert judgments would be both possible and feasible in such contexts.

c. Libertarian Arguments

According to Libertarianism, each individual agent fully owns himself.  As a full self-owner, the agent is entitled to use his various abilities to acquire property rights in the world.  For the libertarian, the primary goal of justice is the protection of negative liberty.  Based on a principle of non-interference, negative liberty is understood as the absence of constraints on an individual’s actions. Some mark a distinction between right-libertarianism and left-libertarianism.  Perhaps the most well-known explication of right-libertarianism, which is often understood as the traditional version of libertarianism, is given by Robert Nozick in Anarchy, State, and Utopia.  Nozick advances an entitlement theory of justice.  On this view, a just distribution is one in which each person is entitled to the holdings that she possesses according to the principles of justice in acquisition, transfer, and rectification. Nozick describes his entitlement theory as “historical,” because it determines the justice of holdings on the basis of how those holdings came to be held, and “unpatterned,” because the justice of holdings is not determined on the basis of some additional normative criteria, such as merit, need, or effort (1974, 155 ff).  Because meritocracies are patterned, Nozick would reject them.  Right-libertarians would be concerned with liberty-restricting attempts at distributing or redistributing resources according to prevailing conceptions of merit or desert.  Therefore, the concept of desert does not have a major role in their theories of justice.   Libertarians need not reject the concept of desert entirely, however.  And Nozick offers various arguments against Rawls’s rejection of desert (1974, 215 ff).  For the right-libertarian, desert could be a concept for the individual to consider in his personal decision-making processes, but not one that the state should use to try to guide allocations or distributions of resources. As with right-libertarianism, left-libertarianism is based on the idea that each individual agent fully owns himself.  But the left-libertarian view about the appropriation of natural resources differs greatly from the right-libertarian view.  Left-libertarians believe in the egalitarian ownership of natural resources.  Anyone who appropriates a natural resource would have to pay others for the value of that resource.  Such a payment might then be placed into a social fund, from which distributions to other members of a society are made.  The resources are divided according to egalitarian principles and not on the basis of merit or desert.  The rejection of desert as a basis of distribution could be based on the metaphysical argument that, strictly speaking, people do not deserve anything.  Or, a left-libertarian could recognize desert as a distributive concept, but one that is less important than equality.  According to such a view, equality, and not desert, should be the primary basis of distribution within a society.

6. Concluding Remarks

Despite its use in daily life, desert is a concept that remains somewhat nebulous.   Regardless of certain areas of disagreement, those who recognize desert as an important normative concept generally agree on a number of issues regarding the nature of desert.  One point of general agreement is that desert consists of, at least, three main parts – a subject, a mode of treatment, and a desert base.  In addition, scholars generally argue in favor of the view that desert is applicable to human beings, or at least some subset of them.  Lastly, scholars generally agree that understanding the nature of desert is important to understanding the nature of justice.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle. Nicomachean Ethics. 2nd Ed.  Translated, with an Introduction, by Terence Irwin.  Indianapolis: Hackett, 1999.
    • An accessible translation that also includes detailed notes and a glossary.
  • Boylan, Michael.  A Just Society.  Lanham, MD: Rowan & Littlefield, 2004.
    • Presents a worldview theory of ethics and social philosophy.
  • Celello, Peter. “Against Desert as a Forward-Looking Concept.” Journal of Applied Philosophy 26, no.2  (May 2009): 144-159.
    • Argues that desert should be understood as a strictly backward-looking concept.
  • Cummiskey, David. “Desert and Entitlement: A Rawlsian Consequentialist Account.” Analysis, 47, no. 1 (Jan., 1987): 15-19.
    • Advances an institution-dependent account of desert.
  • Daniels, Norman.  “Merit and Meritocracy.” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 7, no. 3 (1978): 206-233.
    • A discussion of meritocracy, and the meriting of both jobs and the rewards attached to those jobs.
  • Feinberg, Joel. Doing and Deserving: Essay in the Theory of Responsibility. Princeton: PrincetonUniversity Press, 1970.
    • A collection of previously published essays, and previously unpublished lectures, focused on issues surrounding the harm and benefit of others.
  • Feldman, Fred. “Desert: Reconsideration of Some Received Wisdom.” Mind, New Series 104, no. 413 (January 1995): 63-77.
    • Argues against the ideas that desert must be backward-looking and that desert requires responsibility.
  • Feldman, Fred. “Responsibility as a Condition for Desert.” Mind, New Series 105, no. 417 (January 1996): 165-68.
    • A reply to Smilansky’s “The Connection between Responsibility and Desert: The Crucial Distinction,” in which Feldman argues that Smilansky’s solution to maintaining a connection between desert and responsibility fails.
  • Hume, David. An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals. Edited by J. B. Schneewind. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 1983.
    • A presentation of Hume’s moral philosophy in which he develops ideas from Book III of A Treatise of Human Nature.
  • Kekes, John. Against Liberalism. Ithaca, NY: CornellUniversity Press, 1997.
    • A sustained criticism of political liberalism, which includes a defense of the view that justice should be understood to combine desert and consistency.
  • Kristjánsson, Kristján. “Justice, Desert, and Virtue Revisited.” Social Theory and Practice 29, no. 1 (January 2003): 39-63.
    • Argues that the sole basis for desert is moral virtue.
  • McLeod, Owen. “Contemporary Interpretations of Desert: Introduction.” In Pojman and McLeod, eds., (1999a): 61-69.
    • A brief essay about desert, its bases, and its relation to other concepts.
  • McLeod, Owen. “Desert and Institutions.” In Pojman and McLeod, eds., (1999b): 186-95.
    • Argues that some desert is institutional and some is preinstitutional.
  • Mill, John Stuart. Utilitarianism. 2nd ed. Edited by George Sher. Indianapolis: Hackett, 2001.
    • Mill’s highly influential explication of the normative ethical theory of utilitarianism.
  • Miller, David. Principles of Social Justice. Cambridge, MA: HarvardUniversity Press, 1999.
    • A theory of social justice that includes detailed treatments of the concept of desert and its role in justice.
  • Miller, David. Social Justice. Oxford: OxfordUniversity Press, 1976.
    • A work on social justice, including a chapter devoted to desert.
  • Moriarty, Jeffrey. “Against the Asymmetry of Desert.” Nous 37, no. 3 (2003): 518–536.
    • Argues against the view that desert can have an important role in retributive justice, while not having an important role in distributive justice.
  • Moriarty, Jeffrey. “Desert and Distributive Justice in A Theory of Justice.” Journal of Social Philosophy 33, no. 1 (Spring 2002): 131-43.
    • Argues that John Rawls recognizes pre-institutional desert and that Rawls’s failure to consider such desert in his theory of justice seems unjust.
  • Nozick, Robert. Anarchy, State, and Utopia. New York: Basic Books, 1974.
    • An influential defense of libertarian principles.
  • Plato. Laws. Translated by Trevor J. Saunders. In Plato: Complete Works, edited by John Cooper. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1997.
  • Plato. Republic. Translated by G. M. A. Grube.  Revised by C. D. C. Reeve. In Plato: Complete Works.
    • The Complete Works contains recent translations of all of Plato’s works, dubia, and spuria.
  • Pojman, Louis. “Equality and Desert.” Philosophy, 72, no. 282 (Oct. 1997): 549-570.
    • Argues that the underlying justification of punishment and reward is desert or merit.
  • Pojman, Louis. Justice. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Pearson, 2006.
    • An accessible introduction to different theories of justice, which includes a chapter on justice as desert.
  • Pojman, Louis, and Owen McLeod, eds. What Do We Deserve?: A Reader on Justice and Desert. New York: OxfordUniversity Press, 1999.
    • Contains selections from many influential works on desert and its role in justice.
  • Rachels, James. “What People Deserve.” In Can Ethics Provide Answers?: And Other Essays in Moral Philosophy, 175-97. Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997.
    • A chapter on desert, which includes a discussion of the relationship between desert and responsibility and a    discussion of desert’s temporal orientation.
  • Rawls, John. A Theory of Justice. Cambridge, MA: HarvardUniversity Press, 1971.
    • Rawls’s seminal work in which he advances a theory of justice as fairness.
  • Scheffler, Samuel. “Justice and Desert in Liberal Theory.” California Law Review 88 (May 2000): 965-90.
    • Discusses Rawls’s view on the asymmetry between desert’s role in distributive and retributive justice, and argues that Rawls rejects prejusticial, but not pre-institutional desert.
  • Schmidtz, David. Elements of Justice. Cambridge: CambridgeUniversity Press, 2006.
    • Argues for a pluralist theory of justice based on principles of equality, desert, need, and reciprocity.
  • Schmidtz, David. “How to Deserve.” Political Theory 30, no. 6 (December 2002): 774-99.
    • Includes a “promissory account” of desert, which has forward-looking aspects.
  • Sher, George. Desert. Princeton: PrincetonUniversity Press, 1987.
    • A detailed examination of desert and its role in justice.
  • Sidgwick, Henry. The Methods of Ethics. 7th ed. London: Macmillan, 1907.
    • His seminal work in which he discusses egoism, intuitional morality, and utilitarianism.
  • Smilansky, Saul. “The Connection between Responsibility and Desert: The Crucial Distinction.” Mind, New Series 105, no. 419 (July 1996a): 485-86.
    • A reply to Feldman’s “Desert: Reconsideration of Some Received Wisdom,” in which Smilansky argues that there is a connection between desert and responsibility.
  • Smilansky, Saul.  “Control, Desert, and the Difference between Distributive and Retributive Justice.  Philosophical Studies, 131(3) (2006): 511–524.
    • Provides a defense of the asymmetry between desert’s role in distributive and retributive justice.
  • Smilansky, Saul. “Responsibility and Desert: Defending the Connection.” Mind, New Series 105, no. 417 (January 1996b): 157-63.
    • A reply to Feldman in which Smilansky argues for a distinction between positive and negative responsibility conditions for desert.
  • Spiegelberg, Herbert. “A Defense of Human Equality.” Philosophical Review 53, no. 2 (1944): 101-24.
    • Defends an ethical principle of human equality, and a view of justice based on that principle.


Author Information

Peter Celello
Ohio State University Newark
U. S. A.

American Wilderness Philosophy

Roosevelt & Muir, by Underwood & Underwood Wilderness has been defined in diverse ways, but most famously in the Wilderness Act of 1964, which describes it “in contrast with those areas where man and his own works dominate the landscape … as an area where the earth and its community of life are untrammeled by man, where man himself is a visitor who does not remain.” The idea of wilderness has played a curious and crucial role in American culture generally, and especially in the rise of American environmentalism. Conquering wilderness was central to colonial and pioneer narratives of progress. Reverence and nostalgia for wilderness became tangled with American nationalism at the end of the 19th century, with the end of the frontier. The passage of the Wilderness Act was an historically important event in American environmental politics, which tied the fate of much of America’s public lands to disputes over the meaning of wilderness. Since then, critics both international and domestic, but mostly from within the environmental movement, have criticized the idea of wilderness. Not that preserving or protecting natural places is a bad idea, rather they argue that thinking about nature in terms of wilderness obscures important issues and leads to bad decisions.

Table of Contents

  1. Etymology
  2. Historical Attitudes
    1. Sources of Antipathy
    2. Sources of Appreciation
  3. Wilderness Preservation: Major Figures
    1. Henry David Thoreau
    2. John Muir
    3. Aldo Leopold
  4. The Wilderness Act
  5. Critical Scholarship
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Etymology

The etymology, or history of a word, is sometimes offered as though the roots revealed the word’s correct, present meaning. This is a misunderstanding, as the meaning of a word changes over time and may end up far from its original use. However, an etymology may provide important clues into the biography of an idea and may have rhetorical significance when the meaning of a word is contested. Both of these are true of the etymology of wilderness.  A rough summary of the roots of wilderness is a place essentially characterized by wild animals.  The oldest and central root in this word is wild. It is present in Common Germanic, and is found in Old English as wilde, with surviving instances from c.725 as an adjective for plants and animals that were not tamed or domesticated and applied similarly to places by c.893. The Oxford English Dictionary gives its probable origin as the pre-Germanic ghweltijos, with a possible parallel in the root of the Latin and Greek words for wild beast.

An alternate and apparently mistaken origin of wild often given in the wilderness literature, repeated in Thoreau’s journals and given by Roderick Nash for instance, is that it is the past participle of will (Nash 2014). Wilderness is understood to be self-willed land, not subjected to the will of a domesticator or cultivator. The resonance of the idea is strong, but unfortunately the Old English willian, the root of will, has no clear connection to wilde. One upshot of rejecting this interpretation is that wild is first a word for plants and animals, later applied by analogy to people, and not vice versa as Nash reports.

The next piece in the etymology is the Common Germanic word for beast, found in Old English as deor. This was combined with wilde to form wilddeor, “wild animal,” with instances known from c.825. The “(d)er” which separates wilderness from wildness, is the root of our modern word for deer. In Old English, this was combined with the suffix –en, to make the adjective wilddeoren, which became wildern in Middle English, and was used to describe places. The –en suffix generally denotes what something is made of, as in “wooden” and “earthen,” so a wildern place is one made of wilddeor, of wild beasts. To this is joined the suffix –ness in an unusually concrete sense to form wilderness..

The centrality of wild animals in the etymology is important. Wilderness points not only to the absence of human culture in the landscape but to the presence of that which is often incompatible with it. When the wolves and the bears flourish, the domestic livestock are in danger, and people fear to walk at night. And wild beasts are easily displaced by human activity and presence. Aldo Leopold calls the crane “wildness incarnate” because of its love of solitude (1949). Nash draws out this connection to animals when he interprets the etymology as “the place of wild beasts” (1970). “If wildlife is removed,” he writes, “although everything else remains visibly the same, the intensity of the sense of wilderness is diminished” (Nash 1970). He cites Thoreau’s delight in the New England Lynx, Theodore Roosevelt’s equating wilderness with big game ranges and Leopold’s discussion of the last Grizzly on Escudilla. Leopold often treats particular species as defining the character of the places they dwell.

2. Historical Attitudes

A history of conflicted attitudes towards wild places and nonhuman nature goes much further back than the roots of the word wilderness. Many languages have no equivalent word to wilderness, but still they have managed sophisticated literature on the question. Both the beauty and the inhospitality of wild nature, and humanity’s ambiguous relationship to it, are common themes going back to the very oldest preserved literature.

In telling the history of attitudes toward wild nature, there are two opposite errors of oversimplification to avoid. On the one hand, some treat the modern American and romantic elevation of wilderness as something entirely new, contrasting with previous expressions of antipathy toward wild nature. Roderick Nash (2014) leans in this direction when he says wilderness began “as the unrecognized and unnamed environmental norm for most of Earth’s history, created as a concept by civilization, thereafter widely hated and feared, and quite recently and remarkably, appreciated.” On the other hand, one might find romantic sounding passages of wilderness appreciation in diverse ancient texts, whether the Epic of Gilgamesh, the Vedas or the Psalms, and conclude that there is nothing particularly new or interesting about the American idea. The more interesting historical questions are the more nuanced considerations concerning how and why wilderness is valued or shunned across times and cultures.

a. Sources of Antipathy

While there was no universal hatred or fear of wild nature in the ancient world, at least not to the exclusion of a great deal of appreciation, there was a remarkable degree of denigration of wild nature, reaching something of a climax in early modern Europe. Romanticism was in part a reaction against this, and the ideas that lead to it, and modern wilderness appreciation and preservation took root in the soil of romanticism. The origins of that hostility are variously attributed to the Jewish and Christian scriptures, Greek and Roman philosophy, the scientific and industrial revolutions, or some combination of these.

Clear claims of anthropocentrism, of the relative worthlessness and proper subjugation of wild nature, are frequently found in ancient Greek and Roman philosophers. Here, rationality is established both as the substance of dignity and worth and as the dividing line between the human and the nonhuman (as well as marking the proper hierarchies between some humans and others). Plato, in the voice of Socrates, makes clear his limited estimation of the value of wild things in the Phaedrus (section 230d) when he writes, “I am devoted to learning; landscapes and trees have nothing to teach me—only the people in the city can do that.” Aristotle shows a much greater inclination to appreciate and study wild nature, but he makes clear its subjugation and secondary value: nature making nothing in vain means that it all must exist for the sake of man (Politics 1256b7-22). Chrysippus agrees, finding it absurd to think that the world could have been made for the plants, or the irrational animals (cited in Coates 1998). The Roman philosopher Lucretius describes the presence of forests, mountains and wild beasts on the earth as a serious defect, taking heart that “these regions it is generally in our power to shun” (cited in Nash 2014). This is not to say that there were no elements of appreciation for wild nature in Greek or Roman society or letters, for that is not the case. But there was a clearly articulated and enduring view which implied wild nature was essentially wasted space.

Many commentators, including Nash, have followed Lynn White’s lead in pointing to theism and the Jewish and Christian scriptures as the source of antipathy toward wild nature (White 1967). These scriptures had a formative influence on modern attitudes toward wilderness because of the prominent use of the word in English translations of the Bible. Spiritual connotations, especially from the Exodus account of the Israelites wandering in the wilderness for forty years, were laid onto the word, as well as new physical associations with arid and desert landscapes. The meaning of these spiritual connotations is complex, as wilderness is at once a place of divine revelation as well as temptation and punishment. The Bible does not clearly convey an overarching attitude of fear or hatred of the wild. Genesis 1 repeatedly declares the goodness of everything, prior to the creation of humans. The Psalms celebrate both the useless parts of nature, such as rock badgers, as well as the dangerous, such as lions, as independently glorifying to God (Psalm 104).  Animals, both wild and domestic, plants and even soil are given protections in the Mosaic Law (for example, Exodus 23:10-11; Deuteronomy 20:19-20, 22:6, 25:4), and God is described as making covenant with the Earth and all its creatures (Genesis 9). Even the often cited passage giving people dominion over the other animals, does not clearly put them at human disposal, for it manifestly did not include permission to eat animals (Genesis 1:28-29; Genesis 9:3).

As Greco-Roman philosophy and Christian theology increasingly joined together in medieval and modern European intellectual culture, the ideas of Plato and Aristotle were given new expression in biblical and theological language. Rationality is privileged by Aquinas in this combined way, for instance, arguing that only the rational creatures can know and love God and thereby fulfill the purpose of creation (Summa Contra Gentiles c.1270).  The enlightenment and scientific revolution included a great revival of interest in Greek and Roman philosophy, and serious interest in nature was focused onto the search for universal, mathematical laws. Francis Bacon’s writings in the early 17th century established a lasting connection between the idea of dominion in Genesis and the project of scientific-technological mastery over nature. The metaphor of nature as machine came to dominate. Descartes argued that, lacking rationality, non-human animals should not be supposed to have souls or consciousness at all, but are mere automata, to be freely experimented upon (Discourse on Method 1637). As the scientific project bore fruit in the industrial revolution, the dominant view of wild nature was as disordered material which could be brought into rational order through science and labor, and thus serve its ultimate purpose of existing for the benefit of mankind. This view is clearly expressed in John Locke’s influential labor-theory of property, which justifies the human worker’s property rights over nature on the basis of nature having little to no value before the worker’s labor was mixed with it (Second Treatise on Government 1689).

The Lockean attitude toward wilderness as waste is clearly evident among the early American colonists. For instance, the Puritan John Winthrop gave as a reason for going to America that it would be wrong to let a whole continent lie waste (Nash 2014). Justification for displacing indigenous people was often asserted on the basis that they had not worked it, or at least not rationally. And the attitude continued to dominate well into the settlement of the west. Alexis de Tocqueville complained upon visiting America in the 1830s that Americans could only see their wilderness as an obstacle to progress (cited in Nash 2014). During the time of the exploration, colonization and settlement of the North America by the Europeans, the idea that the less rational parts of nature existed for the sake of the more rational was thoroughly entrenched. And wilderness especially had to be transformed by labor to fulfill that purpose.

b. Sources of Appreciation

The scientific revolution also produced a contrary attitude towards nonhuman nature, however, best expressed in a group known as the physic-theologians. Writers such as John Ray (1627-1705) found in wild nature, not the absence of rationality, but the rational design of God, worthy of study and contemplation. Indeed, studying wild nature was thought to be an especially important path to understanding God, since only wild nature was unaffected by the fall and sin of mankind. Physico-theology contributed to the rise and influence of natural history, an approach to science that in turn deeply informed the wilderness preservation movement.

The practice of natural history flourished in America in the 18th and 19th centuries and was characterized by the description, collection and classification of natural specimens and objects. The fondness of European aristocrats and intellectuals for natural curiosities from around the world made natural history a singular way for colonists to stay connected to the social and intellectual affairs of Europe. The travel and work of natural historians was thus often tangled with the broader European projects of exploration and conquest, and the naturalists, who frequently found themselves caring for what was being destroyed, often expressed significant concern about this connection. Natural historians were largely generalists, writing about nature as a comprehensive whole, and often organized in local, amateur, natural history societies (Smallwood 1967). Some like Alexander von Humboldt, were well connected members of European society who travelled over much of the world, while others like John and William Bartram and John James Audubon were from the colonies and travelled only regionally. Artistic and literary abilities were crucial for their success, and the travel narratives of naturalists became a popular literary genre, where some of the earliest and strongest positive evaluations of wild nature found their greatest audiences.

Romanticism, a multifaceted cultural trend and backlash against the scientific and industrial revolutions, brought not just an acceptance but an enthusiastic veneration of wild nature and wilderness to cultural prominence. Romanticism had strong connections to the natural history tradition: William Wordsworth and Samuel Coleridge were readers of William Bartram (Smallwood 1967), and Alexander von Humboldt was closely associated with Goethe. But romanticism’s influence on wilderness appreciation comprised much more than its further endorsement of natural history as a significant mode of science. Romanticism treated aesthetic responses to nature as just as important as nature’s quantifiable properties, and developed a robust conception of the sublime. Romantic trends in literature and painting, especially the Hudson River school, produced many powerful, positive portrayals of wilderness. Suspecting that modern industrial society corrupts people rather than cultivates them, romanticism also endorsed primitivism and the pursuit of frequent solitude in nature.

Another aspect of romanticism that was important for the rise of wilderness preservation, was its emphasis on nationalism. America’s great wilderness became a point of pride and national identity, something that set it apart from Europe. The historian Frederick Jackson Turner argued that several aspects of the American character, from self-reliance to a democratic spirit, were products of the American frontier experience (1921). And he worried that the continuation of the American national distinctiveness was jeopardized by the end of the frontier, which was formally declared in the 1890 census. Frontier nostalgia drove a lot of early preservation work, as well as related phenomena, particularly the scouting movement and recreational hunting.

America also saw the development of a distinctive form of the romantic movement known as American transcendentalism. Ralph Waldo Emerson’s Nature, a seminal text for transcendentalism, explores the importance of solitude, the beauty of nature and the significance for both of these for understanding God. Emerson’s influence on Henry David Thoreau, and his long relationship with him, plants the roots of the American wilderness preservation movement firmly in transcendentalism. For Thoreau is the first major figure and intellectual of the wilderness tradition.

Another important factor in in the growing appreciation of wilderness was America’s early experience with extensive deforestation. Among the many who bemoaned this loss, none articulated the problem for the public more clearly and effectively than George Perkins Marsh. His 1864 Man and Nature first clearly indicted deforestation for its effects on soil and water. Marsh refuted the naïve optimism of the day, concerning the beneficial effects of all human labor on nature, and outlined rather the devastating, unintended harms caused by inappropriate uses of land. The economically practical case he provided for the conservation of forests and general care for the land provided an important complement to the aesthetic and spiritual emphasis of the romantics.

3. Wilderness Preservation: Major Figures

Expressions of wilderness appreciation multiplied quickly in the late 19th and early 20th century, and many people made distinctive contributions in art, literature, science and policy. A few major figures, however, laid out distinctive visions which guided the course of wilderness preservation, and which contemporary scholars tend to treat as the defining core of the tradition.

a. Henry David Thoreau

Thoreau’s work develops many of the romantic themes towards nature. Especially in Walden, he is concerned with the degrading influence of too much society, commerce and industry and with the salutary effects of nature’s company. He was a frequent canoe traveler and mountaineer, and developed a daily habit of extensive hiking. Both Walden and his travel writings argue for the existence of deeper meanings and higher uses in nature than as mere material for the human economy. He found the aesthetic value of nature to be spiritually and morally important, and woefully underappreciated. But he also spoke of a broader point view, which sees the weeds as food for the birds and the squirrels as planters of the forest. Recognizing that nature, often in the very places it is widely despised, has hidden and indirect values, he anticipates the contemporary economic idea of ecosystem services.

After his stay at Walden Pond, Thoreau turned his energies increasingly to natural history, particularly in the mode of Humboldt. He expressed some concern about the possibility of a purely scientific disenchanting nature and dulling of the imagination. But he was committed to cultivating the greatest awareness of nature as possible and to fully appreciating the value of facts, refusing to reduce appearances to the merely symbolic as Emerson had tended to. He kept careful records of plant and animal distribution and phenology, which have proven valuable for current climate science, and made seminal contributions to the understanding of forest succession and seed distribution. Unfortunately Thoreau’s early death left many of these projects unfinished and unpublished, although most are now available. His extensive journals, influential works in their own right, show a rich blending of this careful attention to natural history with the poetic and philosophical insight.

The essay Walking, revised and reworked until the end of his life, is particularly significant for wilderness thought. In this essay he treats wildness as the highest ideal of ethics and aesthetics and defends the view that both land and people need a balance of the cultivated and the wild, albeit sharply tilted toward the wild. In this work appears his oft-quoted dictum that “In wildness is the preservation of the world.” Max Oelschlaeger points to Thoreau’s lament for pine trees reduced to mere lumber as the earliest and clearest statement of a preservationist’s credo: “Every creature is better alive than dead, men and moose and pine trees, and he who understands it aright will rather preserve its life than destroy it” (cited in Oelschlaeger 1991). Other late works, such as Huckleberries, progress from his early radical valuations of nature to clear preservationist policy arguments for parks, greenways and protected areas.

Considered a minor figure at first, then highly esteemed in American literature and political thought, Thoreau’s philosophical contributions—not only to environmental philosophy but also epistemology, philosophy of science and ethics—received increasing attention in the early 21st century.

b. John Muir

The Muir family emigrated from Scotland when Muir was a young boy, as his father sought the opportunity to live his Campbellite faith more authentically. Muir’s childhood was saturated with an evangelical Biblicism and the poetry of Robert Burns, the Scottish romantic. His experience as a frontier farmer was largely negative, as he was sorely abused by his father for hard labor. Thanks in part to his genius for mechanics and invention, he found his way to the University of Wisconsin in Madison where he found an enthusiasm for botany. He also encountered transcendentalism and a romantic, nature-centered spirituality, which at first supplemented and then gradually transformed his evangelical faith. There is substantial debate on if and when he might be considered a pantheist. What is clear is that Muir’s wilderness philosophy is often expressed in much more intensely religious language than Thoreau’s, and is frequently wrapped in biblical metaphor.

Frequently a solitary traveler in the wilderness himself, he often focused on the potential of wilderness and of nature study for personal and spiritual transformation. His prescription for overworked and materialistic America was a conversion, a baptism in mountain beauty and reconciliation to wild nature. Muir found nature to be not only sublime and beautiful but earnestly benevolent. Even what appears harsh and destructive in nature, such as glaciation (a process on which he became a significant expert), should be seen as part of the ongoing, loving, creative process. Like Thoreau, Muir found tame and domestic plants and animals to be generally degraded versions of their wild counterparts, and he sometimes spoke in terms of the rights of nonhuman nature.

Muir’s increasing political significance grew out of his personal involvement with Yosemite, and its gradual progress toward becoming a national park. He became convinced that federal ownership was the only way that such exceptional places could be preserved from destruction. While God had preserved California’s giant trees through the ages, he wrote, only Uncle Sam could protect them from fools (1901). His eloquent writing on behalf of national parks and preservation made him a figurehead for the movement, a role which was formalized with the formation of the Sierra Club with him as charter president.

Early in the 20th century, the movement for conservation on public lands began to fracture. Muir came to represent one end of a spectrum on how much and what sort of economic uses should be present in the federal reserves. Muir’s emphasis on the spiritual and aesthetic values of wilderness clashed with the progressive, utilitarian vision of Gifford Pinchot, who was more concerned that the nation’s resources should be developed efficiently for the public good, protected from shortsighted exploitation for private enrichment. The proposed and eventual damming of Hetch Hetchy Valley, within Yosemite National Park, for municipal water and power, brought this tension to bitter conflict during Muir’s later years. Muir was not opposed to productive work in nature, nor the human transformation of it in many places. He spent many profitable years working in sawmills and later managing a vineyard. But beauty, he held, is as much a need as bread or water is, and our physical needs can be met without destroying our most beautiful scenery. Just as timber can be had without cutting the redwoods, water could be had without flooding a national park. Muir saw the problem as one of greed for profit unconstrained by higher sensibilities.

c. Aldo Leopold

Aldo Leopold made significant contributions to both wilderness philosophy and policy. An avid naturalist and outdoorsman, Leopold worked within the new forest service to enhance recreation and hunting opportunities. He developed and established the scientific practice of game management. He was constant in his advocacy of a thoughtful and informed stewardship of nature, but his early confidence in the possibility and value of scientific manipulation the land for increased timber and game production was heavily tempered in his mature work.

Leopold’s major policy contribution was to push for a separate classification of land within the national forests, to be kept as roadless wilderness—a clear precursor to the Wilderness Act. Leopold, and those who followed his lead, such as Bob Marshall and the other founders of the Wilderness Society, were responding to the rise of the automobile, which Muir had not so much appreciated as a threat to wilderness. Touring and camping by automobile was growing rapidly, and the parks and forest recreation areas were filling with the roads and hotels to accommodate them. Leopold sought to protect some areas from this sort of development, first for those who wished to pursue more primitive types of recreation, including travel by canoe and pack train, and seekers of solitude, and then later for the protection of land and wildlife.

Philosophically, Leopold integrated wilderness appreciation with the maturing science of ecology, developed new arguments for preserving wilderness and articulated a moral vision for human relations to nonhuman nature, which he called the land ethic. From ecology, Leopold took a much more detailed picture of the land as an interdependent system of plants, animals, soils and natural processes—a biotic community. Understanding the land as a functionally integrated entity means that the land can be healthy or sick, analogously to an organism. Nutrients can be retained in cycles or lost; soils can be accumulated or depleted; species can persist or become extinct. Only healthy land has the capacity to replenish itself when disturbed. And since the workings of the land mechanism are beyond a full human understanding, an attitude of caution is warranted. Removing predators (the standard practice when he began his forestry career) could lead to disastrous consequences for soils and plants, a lesson he learned from personal experience.

Leopold developed the recreation argument for wilderness along several lines. Against charges of elitism, that big wilderness served the small minority with the strength and leisure time for it, he held that minority interests are worthy of protection. There is no danger of insufficient places for the more popular auto tourism, and public lands should not all be devoted to one kind of recreation. Camping and woodcraft are not only an idle nostalgia for our frontier past, they are a moral improvement upon it, directing old instincts to higher ends. He likened this change to the way football is an improvement over war; the transformation to sport preserved the best parts of the older practice without the downsides.

In later works, Leopold increasingly emphasized the value of wilderness for science. Wilderness is not the only healthy land, some traditional agricultural landscapes have showed long-term resilience, but it provides crucial examples of biotic communities that have functioned well over long time spans. Ecologists need wilderness the way doctors need healthy bodies to study. His own restoration of a worn-out farm demonstrated the practical value of this kind of ecological knowledge. Wilderness is also an important refuge for preserving wildlife, especially the large predators generally eliminated in other places. The arguments from science and wildlife are not entirely separate from the recreation argument, as Leopold suggests that wildlife study is one of the greatest forms of outdoor recreation.

The land ethic grew out of Leopold’s conviction that only a change in our ethical attitude toward the land could prevent us from spoiling it. Such a change he thought was not only possible but underway. The care people naturally feel toward their community and their neighbor can be extended to the land, for ecology clearly shows that the land is a community to which we belong. The recognition that we are plain members and citizens of that community supports the restraint and forbearance that is necessary to live in harmony with the land. Preserving the “integrity, stability and beauty of the biotic community” should limit our use of the land, as surely as economic feasibility does.

Leopold’s land ethic has been heralded as the first ecocentric ethic, an approach finally adequate to our environmental problems. It has also been criticized as offering a fascist justification for overriding individual rights in the interest of the community (Tom Regan, cited in Callicott 1987). Its lineage has also been debated: whether it is based on Darwin’s use of Hume’s ethics (Callicott 1987), or if it has more in common with the pragmatism Leopold would have encountered at Yale (Norton 1988). Either way, Leopold’s respect for the biotic community and his vision of wilderness as an important use within federal lands profoundly shaped the future of environmental thought and the coming Wilderness Act.

4. The Wilderness Act

The National Wilderness Preservation System was created with the passage of the Wilderness Act in 1964. The Act did not create a separate agency, but designated and protected roadless areas within federal lands, whether managed by the Forest Service, National Park Service, Fish and Wildlife Service or the Bureau of Land Management. The Act provides for substantial public input on proposed listings and requires congressional action for land to be added or removed from the system. Similar to national parks, wilderness areas are required to be managed under a twin mandate, kept both for the “use and enjoyment” of the people and preserving their wilderness character unimpaired.

The Wilderness Act includes a poetic definition of wilderness, which has been the subject of much critical discussion:

A wilderness, in contrast with those areas where man and his own works dominate the landscape, is hereby recognized as an area where the earth and its community of life are untrammeled by man, where man himself is a visitor who does not remain. An area of wilderness is further defined to mean in this Act an area of undeveloped Federal land retaining its primeval character and influence, without permanent improvements or human habitation, which is protected and managed so as to preserve its natural conditions and which (1) generally appears to have been affected primarily by the forces of nature, with the imprint of man's work substantially unnoticeable; (2) has outstanding opportunities for solitude or a primitive and unconfined type of recreation; (3) has at least five thousand acres of land or is of sufficient size as to make practicable its preservation and use in an unimpaired condition; and (4) may also contain ecological, geological, or other features of scientific, educational, scenic, or historical value.

Some of the definition’s notable features are the emphasis on the absence of human presence and impact, the language of degree and subjective appearance and the unusual word, “untrammeled.” Trammel is not a form of trample, and does not involve the idea of walking. It means to bind up, constrain or fetter, not simply touch or influence. Trammel can also be a noun, referring to a kind of fish net or to rope shackles tied on a horse’s legs to keep it from galloping.

Implementation of the Wilderness Act required some interpretive decisions. The Forest Service, generally seeking to maintain more flexible control over its lands, argued for a strict interpretation of wilderness, excluding any lands with a significant history of human impact. This came to be known as the purity policy. Others, including the Wilderness Society, the non-profit organization which had first pushed for the law and shepherded it through the years of debate before it finally passed, argued for a more flexible and pragmatic understanding of wilderness (Turner 2012). Rather than looking back at whether the land had suffered human impact, the question was whether it could be managed in a way that would render human impact substantially unnoticeable in the future (Woods 1998).

At stake in this question was both how big the wilderness system could be and whether there would be more than a few wilderness areas east of the Mississippi, where historic impacts were generally greater. The forward-looking approach championed by the Wilderness Society eventually triumphed with the 1975 designation of many eastern areas with significant past impacts, which has come to be called the Eastern Wilderness Act.

Another issue that came into the question of purity was how much wilderness should be protected from recreational overuse. Frontier nostalgia tended to a form of recreational woodcraft that was fairly high impact, with campers cutting boughs for beds and lean-tos, for instance. As outdoor recreation continued to increase in popularity through the 1960s and 70s, there was debate over whether wilderness and lands for recreation ought to be given separate designations, which would have resulted in far less wilderness areas. The dilemma was mitigated with a movement toward low-impact camping, culminating in the Leave No Trace program (Turner 2002). While vastly increasing the number of people who can camp in a wilderness area without spoiling it, the new methods have also introduced a greater dependence on consumer products and synthetic materials and reduced the need for knowledge of the natural history of the place.

Another test for the meaning of federal wilderness areas would come with the debates over public lands in Alaska, where vast roadless areas often contained indigenous peoples practicing subsistence lifestyles. In 1980, the Alaska National Interest Lands Conservation Act added 56 million acres to the National Wilderness Preservation System, more than doubling its size, but permitting many activities crucial to subsistence living not permitted in designated wilderness outside Alaska. Some motorized access and even log cabins, it was decided, do not pose the same threat to the “Earth and its community of life” in Alaska as they would in the more densely populated U.S. states.

5. Critical Scholarship

Wilderness preservation has often faced criticism and opposition in the political arena. The Sagebrush Rebellion was largely a reaction against the implementation of the Wilderness Act on western lands. Such conflict is often rooted in issues of public versus private property rights. The academic literature on wilderness has tended to focus on other issues—the history of the idea, its influence on policy, and whether it represents a reasonable or appropriate approach to nonhuman nature.

Roderick Nash’s 1967 book, Wilderness and the American Mind, was the seminal work for contemporary wilderness scholarship. It traced the history of the idea of wilderness from ancient attitudes toward nature through the passage of the Wilderness Act. Nash frames the story as the remarkable rise of appreciation for wilderness from the midst of long-standing antipathy. Though not without offering some criticism, the work is largely celebratory of the wilderness tradition and preservation movement and has had an enduring popularity with the backpackers and activists as well as a lasting influence on scholarship. Much of the wilderness scholarship subsequent to Nash’s work has essentially aimed to supplement or correct the general picture given in it.

The first in a series of criticisms and responses, that came to be known as the great new wilderness debate, came from Ramachandra Guha, an environmental and political historian from India (1989). Guha argued that the radical environmental movement in America had an unhealthy focus on biocentrism and wilderness, which are largely irrelevant to the problems he claims are at the root of the environmental crisis: overconsumption and militarization. Environmentalism in India has largely been a class struggle between the rural poor, who depend on the forests for their subsistence, and the over-consuming urban industrialists, which threaten to destroy the forests and poor alike. Western environmental organizations coming into India and working to establish wilderness-like reserves, such as the tiger reserves, are further displacing traditional subsistence economies to make playgrounds for the wealthy. Wilderness, according to Guha, was not appropriate in densely and long inhabited places like India.

William Cronon, an environmental historian, and J. Baird Callicott, an environmental philosopher, followed with arguments that there was something more deeply flawed about the idea of wilderness, even in North America (Cronon 1995; Callicott 1991). Unlike Guha, both insisted that they support protected areas; their problem was with a way of thinking. Wilderness is historically false, denying the long and extensive human influences on the North American landscape, and thus continuing the denial of the humanity of Native Americans. Wilderness thinking presupposes a pre-Darwinian dichotomy between people and nature by treating only people-less places as real or pristine nature. The result of this dualism is misanthropy and a tendency to see the removal of people as the solution to every environmental problem. Holding wilderness to be the ideal form of nature, they argued, is an obstacle to a responsible environmentalism, which must help us live in harmony with nature in the places we inhabit and work not just the places we visit and play in. Cronon in particular worried that caring for pristine nature far from home makes it easier to tolerate the abuse and destruction of mundane nature close to home. Wilderness thinking, they alleged, also tends to treat nature as static, seeking to preserve a place in a particular form, instead of recognizing the dynamic processes at play in nature.

More critics soon followed, drawing out the imperialism, colonialism or ethnocentrism latent in the preservation project. Many of the criticisms were clearly grounded. Frontier nostalgia requires a certain blindness to the perspectives of Native Americans, and western style parks have been implemented in Africa in ways that are brutal to the indigenous inhabitants. But many wilderness advocates found the criticisms to be unfair overall and not helpful to achieving the responsible environmentalism the critics claimed to desire. The Wilderness Act had not endorsed an ideal of pristine or untouched nature, and the Forest Service’s attempt to interpret it that way had been roundly defeated (Friskics 2008). And the experience in Alaska had showed that wilderness preservation need not be hostile to indigenous people or traditional subsistence cultures. It is not that the environmental movement in America has only sought wilderness preservation and not worked for reform in forestry, agriculture and industry; it is just that reform efforts have often been less successful and harder to accomplish than wilderness designation (Foreman 1998).

Val Plumwood gives a thorough analysis of the issue of dualism in the wilderness tradition, finding it in the frequent appellation, “virgin,” and the legal doctrine of terra nullius in the Australian outback (1998). But she also demonstrated how much of the tradition is open to a non-dualistic interpretation, treating the other of wilderness not as the mere absence of the human but as the presence of something else. The extensive concern with natural history in all the major figures of the wilderness tradition strongly supports this non-dualistic interpretation of wilderness as presence. And if wilderness is not simply the absence of human touch, then valuing and preserving it need not lead to misanthropy. People visiting but not remaining is not the essence of wilderness but a practical strategy for protecting what is essential to wilderness: the living, active presence of nonhuman nature, whether it be grizzly bears or giant trees.

Other responses have come from the new conservationists, a diverse alliance of wilderness activists and conservation biologists, which have pushed for a much more aggressive preservation strategy in the 90s and 2000s. The Wildlands Project, for example, proposed a map of wilderness areas, buffer zones and wildlife corridors that puts 50% of the contiguous US into some form of protected status. James Turner suggests that this more aggressive strategy precipitated the great new wilderness debate (2012). But the new conservationists, such as Reed Noss and Dave Foreman, are clear that their sense of wilderness is largely about securing the wildlife habitat necessary to mitigate the extinction crisis (Foreman 1995, 1998 and Noss 1991). Rather than looking for lands supposedly never touched by people, they seek to restore much land that is presently heavily trammeled and dominated by the works of man. And rather than seeing nature as static, their pursuit of bigger and bigger wilderness areas is driven by an increased understanding of landscape dynamics and of the population sizes needed for evolution to occur.

The legacy of wilderness in America thought and policy is complex, with some parts that have many opponents (for example, the erasure of indigenous cultures and histories) and some that have very wide appeal (for example, the national parks). The writings of Thoreau, Muir and Leopold have enriched and enchanted the lives of many Americans. The National Wilderness Preservation System has been remarkably successful at preserving large roadless areas, and many conservation biologists see an extension of this strategy as the best hope for protecting biodiversity. Others have found the cultural baggage of wilderness too great, and would prefer to take other strategies, hoping to better integrate the human economy with natural systems. Clearly wilderness preservation cannot solve all environmental problems, such as environmental injustice or climate change, but it may help with a lot of problems, even those.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Abbey, Edward. Desert Solitaire: A Season in the Wilderness. (New York: McGraw Hill, 1968).
    • An influential articulation of a wilderness philosophy, this book was written after the Wilderness Act but early in the process of review and designation. It is deeply imbued with an appreciation of the desert southwest.
  • Bartram, William. Travels and Other Writings. Thomas P. Slaughter, ed. (New York: Library of America, 1996).
  • Bartram’s Travels, first published in 1791.
    • His major literary work, representing natural history in a romantic mode and a literary genre of significant importance for the growing wilderness appreciation.
  • Bugbee, Henry. The Inward Morning: A Philosophical Exploration in Journal Form (Athens, Ga: University of Georgia Press, 1999). First published in 1958.
    • A remarkable and beautiful use of wilderness for understanding reality and our place in it. Deep Thoreauvian reflections in dialogue with mid-20th century philosophy.
  • Callicott, J. Baird. “The Conceptual Foundations of the Land Ethic.” Companion to A Sand County Almanac: Interpretive and Critical Essays. J. Baird Callicott, ed. (Madison: University of Wisconsin Press, 1987): 186-217.
  • Callicott, J. Baird. “The Wilderness Idea Revisited: The Sustainable Development Alternative” The Environmental Professional 13 (1991): 235-47. Reprinted in The Great New Wilderness Debate.
  • Callicott, J. Baird and Michael Nelson, eds. The Great New Wilderness Debate (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1998).
    • A comprehensive collection of contemporary wilderness criticism, including a selection of important works from across the history of the wilderness tradition.  It also includes several significant original pieces.
  • Callicott, J. Baird and Michael Nelson, eds. The Wilderness Debate Rages On: Continuing the Great New Wilderness Debate (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 2008).
    • A second large collection, this volume includes a lot of the critical scholarship on wilderness published since the first collection. It also covers some gaps in the previous volume, including important works by early 20th century ecologists and more discussion of race and class.
  • Chipeniuk, Raymond. “The Old and Middle English Origins of ‘Wilderness.’” Environments 21(1991): 22-28.
  • Coates, Peter. Nature: Western Attitudes since Ancient Times (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1998).
    • This book is especially helpful on Roman and Medieval times, often skipped over in other treatments, and it balances the history of ideas with the history of the environment, considering ancient impacts in some depth.
  • Cole, David N. and Laurie Yung, eds. Beyond Naturalness: Rethinking Park and Wilderness Stewardship in an Era of Rapid Change. 2nd ed. (Washington, D.C.: Island Press, 2010).
    • Diverse approaches to interpreting naturalness and wildness are considered in light of the practical management of protected areas and the challenges currently facing such management, including climate change and invasive species.
  • Cronon, William, ed. Uncommon Ground: Rethinking the Human Place in Nature. (New York: W. W. Norton & Company, 1995).
    • This anthology is largely critical of the idea of wilderness and includes Cronon’s much discussed piece, “The Trouble with Wilderness, or, Getting Back to the Wrong Nature.” It includes several other worthwhile chapters as well, particularly Anne Spirn’s chapter on the legacy of Frederick Law Olmsted.
  • Emerson, Ralph Waldo. Nature (Boston: James Munroe & Company, 1836).
    • Emerson’s classic is widely available in print and on the internet, including a scanned image of the 1836 original.
  • Friskics, Scott. “The Twofold Myth of Pristine Wilderness: Misreading the Wilderness Act in Terms of Purity” Environmental Ethics 30 (2008): 381-99.
  • Foreman, Dave. “Wilderness Areas for Real.” The Great New Wilderness Debate.. J. Baird Callicott and Michael Nelson, eds. (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1998): 395-407.
  • Foreman, Dave. “Wilderness: From Scenery to Nature” Wild Earth 5(4) (Winter 1995/96): 9-16. Reprinted in The Great New Wilderness Debate.
  • Guha, Ramachandra. “Radical American Environmentalism and Wilderness Preservation: A Third World Critique.” Environmental Ethics 11 (1989): 71-83. Reprinted in The Great New Wilderness Debate.
  • Harding, Walter. The Days of Henry Thoreau: A Biography. 2nd ed. (Mineola, NY: Dover Publications, 2011).
    • First published by Knopf in 1965, this biography has seen many printings. See also Richardson, 1988.
  • Hargrove, Eugene C. Foundations of Environmental Ethics (Denton: Environmental Ethics Books, 1996).
    • First published in 1989, this work is valuable for its discussion of the history of property rights and their tension with preservation. It also defends the viability of aesthetic arguments for preservation and their connection to wildlife conservation.
  • Harvey, Mark. Wilderness Forever: Howard Zhaniser and the Path to the Wilderness Act (Seattle: University of Washington Press, 2005).
    • Zhaniser was the primary author of the Wilderness Act and a driving force behind its eventual passage.
  • Leopold, Aldo. A Sand County Almanac and Sketches Here and There. Special Commemorative Edition (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1987). First published in 1949.
    • Aldo Leopold’s most influential work, accepted for publication just before his death. The last section of the book, called the “Upshot,” contains the most direct discussion of wilderness and the land ethic.
  • Leopold, Aldo. The River of the Mother of God and Other Essays. Susan L. Flader and J. Baird Callicott, eds. (Madison: University of Wisconsin Press, 1991).
    • Many of Leopold’s other works, arranged chronologically, enabling the reader to see the development of his thought over time.
  • Lewis, Michael. American Wilderness: A New History (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007).
    • An anthology covering diverse aspects of the history of wilderness and preservation in America, updating and complementing Nash’s work in several ways. For instance, it includes a chapter chronicling the extensive role of women and women’s clubs in the early preservation movement.
  • Lowenthal, David. George Perkins Marsh: Prophet of Conservation (Seattle: University of Washington Press, 2000).
    • A scholarly biography situating Marsh’s life and work in relation to the early conservation movement.
  • Marsh, George Perkins. Man and Nature; or, Physical Geography as Modified by Human Action (New York: Charles Scribner, 1864).
    • Immensely influential on the beginnings of the conservation movement, this work by Marsh first clearly established that human labor in nature is often more destructive than helpful. He focuses on the role of forests and deforestation on the condition of waters and soils and on the possibility of people working to heal or restore damaged land.
  • Meine, Curt D. Aldo Leopold: His Life and Work (Madison: University of Wisconsin Press: 1988).
    • This is the foremost biography of Leopold. The 2010 edition has a new preface and a contribution from Wendell Berry.
  • Muir, John. Our National Parks. (Boston: Houghton, Mifflin & Company, 1901).
  • Muir, John. Nature Writings. William Cronon, ed. (New York: Library of America, 1997.)
    • Most of Muir’s writings were published first as magazine articles, and later collected into books. This collection contains many of the most influential pieces.
  • Nash, Roderick Frazier. Wilderness and the American Mind. 5th ed. (New Haven: Yale, 2014)
    • First published in 1967, this work was path breaking scholarship and has had enduring popularity with wilderness enthusiasts and activists. Several chapters have been added in subsequent additions, and the 5th edition includes a forward by Char Miller.
  • Nash, Roderick Frazier. “‘Wild-d­ēor-ness,’ The Place of Wild Beasts.” Wilderness: the Edge of Knowledge. Maxine E. McCloskey, ed. (San Francisco: Sierra Club, 1970):  34-37.
  • Norton, Bryan G. “The Constancy of Leopold’s Land Ethic.” Conservation Biology 2(1) (1988): 93-102.
  • Noss, Reed. “Wilderness Recovery: Thinking Big in Restoration Ecology.” The Environmental Professional 13 (1991): 225-34. Reprinted in The Great New Wilderness Debate.
  • Oelschlaeger, Max. The Idea of Wilderness (New Haven: Yale, 1991).
    • Extensive treatment of the major figures of the wilderness tradition. Includes a notable chapter on the poets Robinson Jeffers and Gary Snyder.
  • Plumwood, Val. “Wilderness Skepticism and Wilderness Dualism.” The Great New Wilderness Debate. J. Baird Callicott and Michael Nelson, eds. (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1998): 652-690.
  • Richardson, Robert. Henry Thoreau: A Life of the Mind (Oakland: University of California Press, 1988).
    • This biography focuses on the intellectual development of Thoreau, with critical discussion of his written work.
  • Sachs, Aaron. The Humboldt Current: Nineteenth-Century Exploration and the Roots of American Environmentalism (New York: Viking, 2006.)
    • Sachs provides an in depth discussion of the influence of romantic natural history, especially in the person of Alexander von Humboldt, on American culture and attitudes toward nature.
  • Smallwood, William Martin. Natural History and the American Mind (New York: AMS Press, 1967).
    • Chronicles the development of natural history and its cultural importance in the American colonies and the young republic.
  • Spence, Mark David. Dispossessing the Wilderness: Indian Removal and the Making of the National Parks (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999).
  • Sutter, Paul. Driven Wild: How the Fight Against Automobiles Launched the Modern Wilderness Movement (Seattle: University of Washington Press, 2002).
  • Thoreau, Henry David. The Journal of Henry D. Thoreau. 14 volumes. B. Torrey and F. Allen, eds. (New York: Dover, 1962). Originally published in 1906.
  • Thoreau, Henry David. Walden: A Fully Annotated Edition. Jeffrey S. Cramer, ed. (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2004).
  • Thoreau, Henry David. Essays: A Fully Annotated Edition. Jeffrey S. Cramer, ed. (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2013).
    • This volume contains “Walking” and his most important wilderness travel and natural history writings.
  • Turner, Frederick Jackson. The Frontier in American History (New York: Henry Holt & Company, 1921).
    • Turner’s “frontier thesis” was originally given as an address in 1893, just after the census declared the end of the frontier. The idea gave fervor to the growing frontier nostalgia, and its accuracy as history has been long debated.
  • Turner, Jack. The Abstract Wild. (Tucson: University of Arizona Press, 1996).
    • A manifesto and sustained argument against, among other things, the sufficiency of managed parks for the preservation of wildness.
  • Turner, James Morton. “From Woodcraft to ‘Leave No Trace’: Wilderness, Consumerism, and Environmentalism in Twentieth-Century America” Environmental History 7(3) (2002): 462-84. Reprinted in The Wilderness Debate Rages On.
  • Turner, James Morton. The Promise of Wilderness: American Environmental Politics since 1964 (Seattle: University of Washington Press, 2012).
    • This work picks up the history where Nash’s book left off, successfully putting to rest any notion that public lands preservation has been less important to environmentalism since the 60s. This is the best source on the way different agencies and organizations have interpreted wilderness in applying the legal designation.
  • White, Lynn, Jr. “The Historical Roots of Our Ecological Crisis.” Science 155 (1967): 1203-07.
  • Woods, Mark. “Federal Wilderness Preservation in the United States: The Preservation of Wilderness?” The Great New Wilderness Debate. J. Baird Callicott and Michael Nelson, eds. (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1998): 131-153.
  • Worster, Donald. A Passion for Nature: The Life of John Muir (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2008).
    • An extensive biography of Muir by one of the foremost environmental historians.
  • Worster, Donald. Nature’s Economy: A History of Ecological Ideas. 2nd ed. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994).
    • This is an important treatment of the romantic natural history tradition and its legacy in general, and of Thoreau in particular.


Author Information

David Henderson
Western Carolina University
U. S. A.

Ethics and Contrastivism

A contrastive theory of some concept holds that the concept in question only applies or fails to apply relative to a set of alternatives. Contrastivism has been applied to a wide range of philosophically important topics, including several topics in ethics. Contrastivism about reasons, for example, holds that whether some consideration is a reason for some action depends on what we are comparing that action to. The fact that your guests are vegetarian is a reason to make vegetable lasagna rather than make roast duck, but not a reason to make vegetable lasagna rather than make mushroom risotto. Contrastivism about obligation holds that what agents are obligated to do can likewise vary with the alternatives. So, for example, you may be obligated to take the book back to the library rather than leave it on your shelf, but not obligated to take the book back to the library rather than send it to the library with a friend. The article begins by clarifying what contrastivism is more generally, in order to see what motivates philosophers to accept contrastivism about some topic. Along the way, challenges and choice points facing the contrastivist will be highlighted. Attention is then given to exploring arguments for, and applications of, contrastivism to topics in ethics, including obligations, reasons, and freedom and responsibility.

Table of Contents

  1. Contrastivism in General
    1. Contrastivism in Different Domains
      1. Epistemology
      2. Philosophy of Science
    2. Contrastivism and Questions
    3. Non-Exhaustivity and Resolution-Sensitivity
  2. Contrastivism in Ethics
    1. Contrastivism about Obligation
    2. Contrastivism and Freedom
    3. Contrastivism about Normative Reasons
  3. General Challenges
    1. Setting the Contrast Class
    2. Cross-Context Inferences
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Contrastivism in General

In this section we will briefly introduce the broad range of topics that have received a contrastive treatment in areas outside of ethics, and see what kinds of arguments contrastivists about some concept deploy. This will give us a broad outline of contrastivism as a general kind of view in philosophy.

a. Contrastivism in Different Domains

i. Epistemology

One of the most well known applications of contrastivism relates to knowledge. There are also contrastive theories of justification and of belief, but I will focus here on knowledge. According to the traditional, non-contrastive conception of knowledge, it is a two-place relation holding between a subject and a proposition: Ksps knows that p. Contrastivism, on the other hand, holds that knowledge is a three-place relation holding between a subject, a proposition, and a contrast.

There are differences in conceptions of the contrast. Some contrastivists treat the contrast as a single proposition, q, incompatible with p, yielding Kspqs knows that p rather than q. Others treat the contrast as a set of mutually exclusive propositions, including p, Q, yielding KspQs knows that p out of Q, where Q may be {p, q, r, s}. This difference is non-essential, at least for most purposes, since we can translate from Kspq to KspQ by letting Q = {p, q}, and we can translate from KspQ to Kspq, where Q = {p, r, s, t}, by letting q = r˅s˅t. Many examples used in arguments for contrastivism involve the phrase “rather than”, which generally contrasts two propositions (“s knows that p rather than q”). So for these examples, the single proposition conception of the contrast is more natural. Nevertheless, we will adopt the set of alternatives conception. As we will see in the section Contrastivism and Questions, this conception more directly represents the important contrastivist idea that contrastivity can be thought of as question-relativity.

Contrastivism about knowledge has its roots in the relevant alternatives contextualist theory of knowledge, developed in, for example, Dretske (1970) and Lewis (1996). According to this theory, whether a knowledge ascription, “s knows that p”, is true in a context depends on which alternatives to p are relevant in that context, and whether s can rule them out. As the context varies, the relevant alternatives may vary, and so whether a knowledge ascription is true can also vary. Relevant alternatives theorists have worked to spell out what makes an alternative relevant in a context, but have not yet produced a very satisfying picture. Contrastivists claim to do better: the relevant alternatives are provided by a question under discussion, which we have independent reason to accept in our theory of communication. For example, linguists (for example, Roberts, 201)) have argued that positing such a question under discussion helps explain various linguistic phenomena.

Contrastivists about knowledge claim several advantages over non-contrastive conceptions. The first kind of argument for contrastivism is linguistic: the theory can make better sense of a range of knowledge ascriptions, including explicitly contrastive ascriptions (“Ann knows that it’s a zebra rather than an ostrich”), ascriptions involving intonational stress (“Ann knows that the zebra is in the pen”), and ascriptions with a wh-complement (“Ann knows where the zebra pen is”). All of these ascriptions are plausibly treated as making reference to a question under discussion, or set of alternatives.

A second kind of argument appeals to theoretical advantages of contrastivism. For example, contrastivism promises to provide a solution to puzzles that have haunted epistemology, like the closure paradox. Moore knows that he has hands, and knows that if he has hands, then he is not a brain in a vat. But Moore does not know that he is not a brain in a vat. How can this be? Well, Moore knows that he has hands rather than flippers, but he does not know that he has hands rather than that he is a brain in a vat. So according to the contrastivist, this seemingly intractable paradox actually relies on a fallacious equivocation: we cannot assume that because Moore knows that he has hands rather than flippers that he therefore knows that he has hands rather than that he’s a brain in a vat. One way to read the closure paradox is as a puzzle about knowledge ascriptions: why do we ascribe Moore knowledge that he has hands but not knowledge that he is not a brain in a vat? But there is also a nonlinguistic side to the puzzle: Moore’s knowledge that he has hands seems incompatible with his ignorance about whether he’s a brain in a vat, given a very plausible closure principle. This does not have anything directly to do with knowledge ascriptions (though obviously intuitions must be drawn out by presenting knowledge ascriptions). It rather points out something troubling about the concept of knowledge: either it does not apply where we think it does, or it does not obey the kind of logic we think it does. The contrastivist solution is to say that knowledge is a contrastive concept, so that the puzzling question is simply ill-conceived. Moore’s knowledge that he has hands is in fact not incompatible with his ignorance about whether he’s a brain in a vat. I call this a theoretical argument for contrastivism, rather than a linguistic one, because it involves showing how contrastivism can resolve paradoxes involving the concept of knowledge, not merely deliver attractive interpretations about a range of knowledge ascriptions.

There are other theoretical arguments for contrastivism about knowledge. First, the theory allows us to track inquiry (See Schaffer, 2005a). Inquiry involves answering questions and ruling out alternatives, and the contrast argument place lets us keep track of the question we are answering, and the alternatives we have ruled out. A further theoretical motivation for contrastivism about knowledge comes from the idea that the most important theoretical and practical function of knowledge is to identify good sources of information (see especially Craig, 1990; Schaffer, 2005a). The contrastivist can add to this claim the observation that when we are looking for good sources of information, we have a particular question in mind (though it may be a quite general question). A good informant for one question (for example, why is it raining rather than snowing?) may not be a good informant for a different question (for example, why is it raining rather than not precipitating at all?). So a contrastive concept of knowledge would best explain its primary function.

These arguments, like other theoretical arguments (for example, Morton, 2012) aim to show that contrastivism lets us best make sense of the theoretical, as well as practical, role of knowledge. The specifics of how these arguments go are less important for our purposes here; the important point is that there are two broad classes of arguments for contrastivism about some concept: (i) linguistic arguments and (ii) theoretical arguments. This pattern carries over to different domains, including ethics. The line between the two kinds of arguments will not be sharp. This is due in part to the fact, noted above, that often theoretical puzzles about some concept have to be drawn out by appealing to ascriptions of that concept. Though many of the clearest motivations for contrastivism do involve ascriptions of the target concept, it is nevertheless important to keep in mind that contrastivism is more than simply a linguistic thesis and has more than simply linguistic advantages.

A special case of contrastivism about knowledge—one that is especially relevant for this article—is Sinnott-Armstrong’s (2006) contrastive account of moral knowledge. Sinnott-Armstrong applies contrastivist ideas developed in his own earlier work and by contrastivists like Schaffer to moral epistemology. An interesting twist is that Sinnott-Armstrong uses contrastivism as a route to a kind of moral skepticism—the view that we do not have moral knowledge. Here is the basic idea: though many explicitly contrastive knowledge ascriptions, like “I know that it is morally wrong to terminate the pregnancy using non-sterilized equipment rather than to terminate the pregnancy using sterilized equipment”, may well be true, we should suspend judgment about the truth of non-contrastive ascriptions like “I know that it is morally wrong to terminate the pregnancy“. All knowledge ascriptions require some set of alternatives before they can be evaluated for truth. If one is not provided explicitly, Sinnott-Armstrong argues, we should understand the ascriptions as “I know that p out of the relevant contrast class”. And this is where the skeptical turn appears: Sinnott-Armstrong argues that we should be relevance skeptics—we should suspend judgment about what the relevant contrast class is. Hence, we cannot evaluate the truth of the unrelativized knowledge claims. This is not quite the dogmatic skeptical claim that we lack moral knowledge. Instead, this is a Pyrrhonian skeptical thesis: we should suspend judgment about the truth of unrelativized attributions of moral knowledge (and of knowledge more generally). Nevertheless, it is notable that other contrastivists appeal to contrastivism to resolve skeptical paradoxes, while Sinnott-Armstrong uses contrastivism in an argument for a kind of skepticism.

ii. Philosophy of Science

Contrastive theses have also been offered in the philosophy of science. Traditional theories of explanation hold that the explanatory relation holds between two relata: pEqp explains q. Contrastive theories of explanation hold that we need at least one, and possibly two, more argument places for contrasts. We may have pQEqp out of Q (or “rather than any other member of Q”) explains q; pEqQp explains q out of Q; or pQ1EqQ2p out of Q1 explains q out of Q2. Once again, there are both linguistic arguments and theoretical arguments for these contrastivist theories. For example, “The warm temperature explains why it is raining rather than snowing” may be true, while “The warm temperature explains why it is raining rather than not precipitating” may be false. (For more on contrastivism about explanation, see van Fraassen, 1980; Lipton, 1990 and Hitchcock, 1996.)

Relatedly, philosophers have offered contrastive theories of causation. Instead of holding that the causal relation is two place, eCfe causes f—contrastivists hold that we need at least one, and possibly two, more argument places. Either eQ1Cf, eCfQ2, or eQ1CfQ2. Contrastivism purports to solve several puzzles facing traditional non-contrastive theories of causation, including causation by absences and the puzzle of saying what the cause of some event is. (See, for example, Schaffer, 2005b, 2012;  and Hitchcock, 1996a, 1996b.)

Finally, philosophers have also offered contrastive theories of confirmation. According to this view, whether some evidence confirms a hypothesis depends on what we are comparing that hypothesis to. For example, the wet sidewalk confirms the hypothesis that it rained rather than that it was sunny all day, but does not confirm the hypothesis that it rained rather than that someone washed her bike on the sidewalk a few minutes ago. (See Chandler, 2007, 2013 and Fitelson, 2012 for discussion.)

b. Contrastivism and Questions

Contrastivists often claim that their theories are ones according to which the target concept is question-relative: relative to one question, the concept holds, while relative to another, it does not. For example, Schaffer (2005a, 2007a) argues that to know that p is to know that p as the answer to the contextually relevant question. So relative to a question like, “Is the bird a canary or a raven?”, you know that it is a canary—you know the answer to this question. But relative to the question, “Is the bird a canary or a goldfinch?”, you do not know that it is a canary—you do not know the answer to this second question.

Question-relativity is a natural idea for contrastivists. Questions—thought of as the informational contents of interrogative sentences, analogously to thinking of propositions as the informational contents of declarative sentences—are standardly treated as partitions over (some part of) logical space. These partitions divide logical space into cells, so that the possibilities are grouped in mutually exclusive classes. These partitions can also be thought of, then, as sets of mutually exclusive alternatives—each alternative in the set corresponds to one cell in the partition. Thus, relativizing a concept to questions simply amounts to relativizing it to sets of alternatives, which is exactly what the contrastivist wants to do. Different questions give us different partitions, and so correspond to different sets of alternatives.

To see this approach in action, return to the epistemological example. The question expressed by “Is the bird a canary or a raven?” is represented by the set of alternatives, {the bird is a canary, the bird is a raven}. Recall that this is a representation of a partition of (part of) logical space into two cells, one containing possibilities in which the bird is a canary and the other containing possibilities in which the bird is a raven. Similarly, the question expressed by “Is the bird a canary or a goldfinch?” is represented by the set of alternatives, {the bird is a canary, the bird is a goldfinch}. If we relativize knowledge to questions, then, we can explain why “You know the bird is a canary” is true when the relevant question is the first, but false when the relevant question is the second. For now, we will assume that in a given context, there is a relevant question which supplies the set of alternatives. In the section “Setting the Contrast Class” we will consider some problems for this assumption.

More directly relevant for ethics, contrastivists about normative concepts like “ought” and reasons have developed theories according to which these concepts are relativized to deliberative questions, or questions of what to do. In a given deliberative context—the kinds of context in which we ordinarily appeal to concepts like “ought” and reasons—there is some particular deliberative question we are trying to answer, since answering a deliberative question is just deciding what to do. This question supplies the set of alternatives relative to which claims about what we ought to do or have reason to do are interpreted.

c. Non-Exhaustivity and Resolution-Sensitivity

Thinking of a contrastive theory of some concept in terms of question-relativity helps bring out two important features of contrastivism. Both of these features are exploited by contrastivists.

First, questions may partition only part of, or some subspace of, logical space. Some possibilities may just not be relevant, for one reason for another, or may be ruled out by the presuppositions of the question. For example, if I ask which beer you want to try, possibilities in which you do not want to try any of the beers are plausibly not included. You can of course say that you do not want to try any beers, but this seems more like rejecting the question (admittedly in a conversationally cooperative way), rather than answering it—answering a question requires selecting one of the alternatives, or one cell of the partition. The relevance of this point for contrastivism is that the set of alternatives to which a concept is relativized may be non-exhaustive of logical space. This is most clear in the case of explicitly contrastive “rather than” ascriptions, like “You know that the bird is a canary rather than a raven”. Here, the contrastivist about knowledge will say that this sentence means that you know that the bird is a canary relative to the set {the bird is a canary, the bird is a raven}. Clearly there are many other possibilities—the bird could be a goldfinch, a crow, a robot made to look like a canary, or you could be dreaming. Relative to sets that include some of these other alternatives, you may not know that the bird is a canary. But since, on this view, knowledge claims are relativized to non-exhaustive sets of alternatives, it may still be true that you know that it is a canary relative to {the bird is a canary, the bird is a raven}.

Second, the possibilities that are partitioned can be grouped together in more or less fine-grained ways. Some distinctions between possibilities may be respected by the partition while others are smudged over. Compare the following two sets: {it’s a bird, it’s not a bird}, {it’s a canary, it’s a goldfinch, it’s a crow, it’s some other kind of bird, it’s a robot, it’s a hallucination, it’s some other kind of non-bird}. The second set makes distinctions between possibilities that are ignored in the first set. These sets differ in what Yalcin (2011) and Cariani (2013) call resolution: sets which make more fine-grained distinctions partition (parts of) logical space at a higher resolution. To say that some concept is resolution-sensitive, at least here, is to say that it is relativized to sets that may vary in resolution. Relative to a set at one resolution, the concept may hold of something, while relative to a set at a different resolution—either higher or lower—it may not.

2. Contrastivism in Ethics

While applications of contrastivism within epistemology and the philosophy of science are more well known, contrastivism has also been applied to a wide range of topics in ethics and normative philosophy more generally. We have already seen that contrastivist ideas have interesting applications in moral epistemology. This section introduces contrastivism about obligation, normative reasons, and freedom and moral responsibility. Having already introduced contrastivism more generally in the previous section, I will focus primarily on describing the specific motivations for the contrastive theories in ethics.

One application of contrastivist ideas in ethics that I will not discuss in detail is due to Driver (2012). Driver suggests a contrastive conception of luck, and makes use of this in her defense of a consequentialist treatment of moral luck. The central contrastivist claim is that no one, or no event, is lucky simpliciter. Rather, something is only lucky or unlucky relative to some contrasts. For example, a patient may be lucky to survive a serious illness rather than die from it, but not lucky to survive the serious illness, rather than not contract the illness in the first place.

a. Contrastivism about Obligation

The oldest application of contrastive ideas in ethics is contrastivism about obligation. Much of the work defending and developing contrastivism about obligation has focused primarily on developing contrastive semantic theories for the terms used to ascribe obligations, especially the deontic modal “ought”. This is not unexpected, since as we saw above, one important style of argument for contrastivism is linguistic in nature; contrastivism about obligation is no different. (Here I will conflate obligation and ought to stick more closely to the literature; the concept of obligation is better expressed using stronger deontic modals like “must” and “have to”.)

Contrastivism about obligation holds that what you ought to do can vary with the comparison being made. For example, though you ought to take the book back to the library rather than leave it on the shelf, it is not the case that you ought to take it back to the library rather than send it with me on my trip to the library.

It is important to distinguish the distinctive contrastivist claim from the much more widely accepted claim that what you ought to do depends on the available alternatives. If some option is the best one available, the non-contrastivist will say that it is what you ought to do. If circumstances change so that that option is no longer available, then obviously it is not the case that you ought to do it—it is not even an option. So what you ought to do has changed with the alternatives. But importantly, it has changed with the available alternatives. There is nothing surprising about this claim, and it is not the distinctive contrastivist claim. The distinctive contrastivist claim is that even holding the available alternatives fixed, what you ought to do can vary with the particular comparison. That is, claims about what you ought to do are only true or false relative to some particular set of alternatives, which may not include all of the available alternatives.

This puts us in a position to see one argument for contrastivism about obligation. Suppose that all of the following methods of getting to work are available: driving your SUV, taking the bus, riding your bike. The relevant factors here are environmental friendliness and getting some exercise. So riding your bike is best and driving your SUV is worst. The non-contrastivist will of course say that, in this case, you ought to ride your bike. And this is very plausible. But the following claim is also very plausible:

(1)   You ought to take the bus rather than drive your SUV.

But since taking the bus is not the best available alternative—riding your bike is also an available alternative—it is hard to see how the non-contrastivist can explain the truth of (1). The contrastivist, on the other hand, has an easy time explaining this. Out of the set of alternatives {take the bus, drive your SUV}, taking the bus is the best. And what you ought to do out of a set of alternatives is the best alternative in that set. So even if there are better available alternatives, we can still make true “ought” claims about suboptimal alternatives, as long as they are the best in the relevant set of alternatives; using a “rather than” claim as in (1) is one way of making a set the relevant one.

The non-contrastivist can of course try to reinterpret claims like (1) so that they do not require relativizing “ought” to sets of alternatives. For example, we may read (1) as saying something like, “If you are going to either take the bus or drive your SUV, you ought to take the bus”. One problem for this reply, as emphasized in an epistemic context by Schaffer (2008), is that this requires reading “rather than” as contributing some kind of conditional. But this is not a plausible general theory about the contribution of “rather than” clauses. It is much more linguistically plausible to treat “rather than” as making explicit the comparison being made, as the contrastivist does.

An even more important source of motivation for contrastivism about obligation comes from the puzzles of deontic logic, the logic of obligation. Many of these puzzles have the following form: acceptable “ought” claims lead, via plausible inference rules, to unacceptable “ought” claims. Here is just one example, called Ross’s Paradox, since it is originally due to Alf Ross (1941). Suppose you promise your friend that you will mail a letter for her. Then (2) is true:

(2)   You ought to mail the letter.

One inference rule that is validated by the standard semantics for “ought”, and by standard deontic logic, is the following:

Inheritance: If doing A entails doing B, then if you ought to do A, you ought to do B.

(This rule is usually stated treating “ought” as a propositional operator, read as “it ought to be that p”, instead of as (directly) ascribing an obligation, as in “you ought to A”. This goes beyond the scope of this article.) Besides being validated by orthodox treatments of “ought”, this inference rule has a lot of initial plausibility. One way to see this plausibility is to think of the special case in which doing B is a necessary means to doing A, and in that sense doing A entails doing B. If the only way to do something you ought to do requires doing B, then very plausibly, you thereby ought to do B. But inheritance leads to unacceptable results. Note that mailing the letter entails either mailing it or burning it, just because A entails (A or B), for any B. So from the acceptable “ought” claim (2), via Inheritance, (3) follows:

(3)   You ought to either mail the letter or burn it.

While (2) is acceptable, (3) is not. It ascribes an obligation to you, mailing the letter or burning it, that you can satisfy by burning the letter. But burning the letter is not a way to do anything you ought to do.

The standard reply to Ross’s Paradox is to accept the consequence, that (3) is true, but explain its apparent unacceptability pragmatically. The basic idea is that (3) is weaker than something else we are in a position to say, namely (2). This is to appeal to Grice’s (1989) maxim of quantity, that we should say the strongest thing we are in a position to say. Saying something weaker, like (3), suggests that we are not in a position to say something stronger, like (2). But in this case, we are in a position to say (2)—in fact, we derived (3) from (2). There have been various challenges to this line of reply; see in particular Cariani (2013).

The contrastivist offers a different solution. The outline of the solution is that the inference from (2) to (3) involves an illicit shift in the set of alternatives to which the “ought” claims are relativized—and hence is equivocal. To see why, remember that the alternatives in a set of alternatives must be mutually exclusive. Then notice that “mail the letter” and “mail the letter or burn it” are not mutually exclusive; so they cannot be members of the same set of alternatives. Thus, (2) and (3) cannot be relativized to the same set of alternatives. In an ordinary context, (2) would be relativized to a set like {mail the letter, leave the letter on the table, give the letter back to your friend, burn the letter}. (3), on the other hand, must be relativized to a set that includes “mail the letter or burn it” as an option, such as {mail the letter or burn it, leave the letter on the table, give the letter back to your friend}. In terms of our distinction between the non-exhaustivity of a set of alternatives, and the resolution of a set of alternatives, inferences like the one from (2) to (3) require a shift in resolution: the second set of alternatives lumps together two options—”mail the letter” and “burn the letter”—that are distinct in the first set. Since the contrastivist about obligation holds that obligation claims are sensitive to the resolution of the set of alternatives to which they are relativized, she can hold that the shift in resolution generates a shift in the truth of the obligation claim.

The first thing to see is that we simply cannot infer (3) from (2): to do so would be to equivocate, since the set of alternatives has shifted. It would be like inferring “Chris Paul is tall”, when he’s playing in a professional basketball game, from the truth of “Chris Paul is tall” when he’s at his family reunion (crucial background: Chris Paul is taller than most other members of his family, but shorter than most basketball players). The comparison class has shifted, and “tall” ascriptions are very plausibly relativized to comparison classes—to count as tall, you have to be taller than most members of the relevant comparison class.

The second thing to notice is that, not only can we not infer (3) from (2), we can also say that (3) is actually false. That is because, very plausibly, out of the set {mail the letter or burn it, leave the letter on the table, give the letter back to your friend}, it is not true that you ought to mail the letter or burn it—this is not the best option in the set.

This is the basic outline for one kind of contrastivist solution to puzzles of deontic logic. Cariani (2013) offers an interestingly different kind of contrastivist solution. Cariani takes up the task of blocking problematic inferences, such as Ross’s Paradox, while retaining intuitively acceptable ones that also seem to be supported by rules like inheritance.

b. Contrastivism and Freedom

Another implementation of contrastivist ideas in ethics is Sinnott-Armstrong’s (2012) contrastive account of freedom and moral responsibility. Central questions in this domain concern whether an agent’s act is free, and hence whether the agent is responsible for the act. Responsibility skeptics argue that since we can always trace the causal history of an act back to causes outside the agent, no one is ever responsible. Their opponents give various responses to this argument, including that freedom and responsibility do not require a lack of causation from outside the agent.

The first application of contrastivism is to what agents are free from. For example, an agent’s act may be free from external physical constraints (for example, chains or a shove) or internal compulsions (for example, addiction), but not free from all preceding causes (for example, the initial conditions of the universe). Such an act would be free rather than the result of a shove or addiction, but not free rather than caused (via a long chain) by the initial conditions of the universe. Adopting this contrastive conception of freedom helps clarify the dispute between responsibility skeptics and their opponents: the debate is over which kind of constraint is the relevant one for attributing responsibility. (Sinnott-Armstrong himself once again denies that there is any one relevant kind of constraint, and so does not take sides in the dispute between responsibility skeptics and their opponents.)

This contrastive picture also explains conflicting intuitions about whether a given act is free. Ordinarily, perhaps, we have in mind constraints like chains or addictions. Most acts in question in debates about freedom and responsibility are free, rather than being constrained by these kinds of things. But what the responsibility skeptic does, is to draw our attention to another kind of constraint—that of causes outside the agent. Actions are very plausibly not free, rather than being caused at all. If the contrastivist about freedom is right that freedom is a contrastive concept, and that both of these kinds of freedom—freedom from constraints and freedom from preceding causes—are legitimate, then this explains why we may be puzzled by questions about whether a given action is free.

The second application of contrastivism is to what agents are free to do. Sinnott-Armstrong’s illustrative example is of an alcoholic, Al. Suppose Al drinks some whisky at 8pm on Tuesday. We may ask whether this act was free. It seems to depend on the contrasts. Depending on how we specify the details of the case, all of the following may be true:

  1. Al’s drinking whisky rather than wine was free.
  2. Al’s drinking whisky at 8pm rather than at 9pm was free.
  3. Al’s drinking whisky rather than a non-alcoholic drink was not free.
  4. Al’s drinking whisky on Tuesday rather than waiting until Wednesday was not free.

As Sinnott-Armstrong sums up the point: “Addicts never have no control at all in any circumstances…most people are free to choose out of some contrast classes but not out of others.” (Sinnott-Armstrong, 2012:145). So the question of whether Al’s act was free is, for the contrastivist, incomplete. To say whether an action was free, we have to specify what the contrast is—relative to some contrasts, it may be free while relative to others it may not be. The important question then becomes which contrasts are relevant for which purposes. In particular, we can ask which contrasts are relevant for blaming and holding responsible. So contrastivism has helped us isolate the important questions in the debate about moral responsibility.

A related position is contrastivism about legal responsibility. Schaffer (2010) applies his contrastive account of causation (described in the section Philosophy of Science) to the notion of legal causation. If we accept that there is a close connection between the claim that someone caused, in the legally relevant sense, some outcome and the claim that she is legally responsible for that outcome, this contrastive account of causation in the law leads naturally to a contrastive theory of legal responsibility.

c. Contrastivism about Normative Reasons

The last application of contrastivism to ethics is contrastivism about normative reasons. A normative reason for an action is a consideration that counts in favor of performing that action. For example, the fact that you promised to return the book is a reason to return it, and the fact that you are causing me pain is a reason to get off of my foot. Many philosophers think reasons are central to ethics, and to normativity more generally. If that is correct, then contrastivism about normative reasons will likely have widespread implications throughout ethics.

As with most other implementations of contrastivism, contrastivism about reasons can be motivated by linguistic considerations:

  1. The fact that my guest is vegetarian is a reason to make vegetable lasagna rather than roast duck.
  2. The fact that my guest is vegetarian is not a reason to make vegetable lasagna rather than mushroom risotto.

Both of these contrastive claims are true. But now we might want to know, “Is the fact that my guest is vegetarian a reason to make vegetable lasagna or not?”. This is to ask whether this fact is a non-contrastive reason. This question is hard to answer. What this seems to show is that whether this fact is a reason or not depends on the alternatives—that it is a contrastive reason.

There are various ways for the non-contrastivist to respond to this argument. In particular, she may try to provide non-contrastive analyses of these contrastive claims. For example, we may appeal to the fact that reasons have strengths or weights, and hold that some consideration is a reason to do A rather than B when it is a stronger (non-contrastive) reason to do A than it is to do B. In this way, we can explain the truth of claims like (4) and (5) without adopting a contrastive view of reasons.

There are various problems with this kind of strategy. For just one, recall the similar strategy for dealing with contrastive obligation claims discussed in the section ”Contrastivism About Obligation”. The idea there was to say that the “rather than” in these claims should be analyzed out as a conditional. The problem was that this is not particularly linguistically plausible, since “rather than” does not ordinarily contribute a conditional. This strategy for dealing with contrastive reason claims faces a similar problem. “Rather than” does not ordinarily mean “stronger than”; instead, “rather than” should be understood as introducing contrasts.

Besides linguistic arguments, the second major kind of argument for contrastivism in some domain is theoretical. Recall that these kinds of arguments are not based primarily on contrastivism’s ability to give attractive interpretations of ascriptions of the target concept—in this case, reasons. Rather, they aim to show that given some theoretical role or property of the target the concept would be best explained by a contrastive view of the concept. A theoretical argument for contrastivism about reasons is that it best makes sense of the connection between reasons and the promotion of various objectives, like desires or values. A schematic statement of this very common idea is the following:

Promotion: Consideration R is a reason to perform act A if R explains why A-ing would promote objective O.

Again, an objective is some valuable thing to be promoted. Different theories will say different things: desire-based theories think reasons are tied to the promotion of the objects of desires, value-based theories think reasons are tied to the promotion of values like justice or goodness, and so on. No matter which of these theories we accept, we have to say what it takes for some action to promote an objective.

Snedegar (2014b) argues that the best way to do this is to adopt a contrastive picture. Relative to some contrasts an action may promote an objective, while relative to another, it may not. Suppose the relevant objective is contributing to the relief of hunger in the third world. This objective is not promoted by donating to an unreliable charity (they only get the money where it should go 20% of the time) rather than donating to a reliable charity. But it is promoted by donating to an unreliable charity rather than spending the money on an expensive dinner for myself. Hence, this objective gives me a reason to donate to the unreliable charity rather than spend the money on an expensive dinner, but does not give me a reason to donate to the unreliable charity rather than donate to the reliable charity. Non-contrastive views of promotion will deliver the verdict that this objective gives me no reason whatsoever to donate to the unreliable charity. So it is hard for them to explain the fact that it gives me a reason to donate to the unreliable charity rather than spending the money on an expensive dinner.

We have seen both linguistic and theoretical motivations for contrastivism about reasons. As we saw at the beginning of this section, reasons are often taken to be central to ethics and normativity more generally. So contrastivism about reasons is likely to have many upshots throughout ethics and normative philosophy. One nice thing about this is that it gives us a huge swathe of philosophy against which to test contrastivism about reasons: contrastivism may lead to exciting insights in normative philosophy, or it may lead to unacceptable results. Either way, this seems to be a fruitful area for research.

3. General Challenges

To close, consider some general challenges facing contrastivism of any variety. The specific form of these challenges, and the plausible responses, will likely vary from domain to domain. When it is necessary to apply the challenge to a concrete contrastivist theory, one from ethics will be chosen. As much as possible, however, the article remains at a general level, because it is instructive to think about the general shape of the challenges, as they face the contrastivist qua contrastivist.

a. Setting the Contrast Class

The first few challenges are interrelated, and have to do with setting the relevant contrast class. First, contrastivists face the challenge of saying what set of alternatives a given claim should be relativized to. For explicitly contrastive ascriptions of a concept, for example those using “rather than”, it is straightforward: the “rather than” clause makes the alternatives explicit. But for ascriptions that are not explicitly contrastive, the contrastivist has to provide some way of settling what the relevant set of alternatives is, or else admit that these unrelativized claims are not truth-evaluable, or at least that we should suspend judgment about their truth. To be satisfactory, this should be done in a relatively principled way. Otherwise, the contrastivist may face charges of fixing the contrasts in an ad hoc way to get the results she wants.

We have already seen one popular way to answer this challenge. This is to appeal to a question under discussion in the context. Linguists and philosophers of language have given arguments independent of contrastivism for the inclusion of such a device in our theory of communication. For example, it is useful in interpreting intonational stress (see Rooth, 1992) and in explaining several kinds of pragmatic phenomena (see Roberts, 2012). The contrastivist can exploit this: the question under discussion fixes the set of alternatives relative to which the ascription is interpreted.

But there are other options. Rather than appealing to a question under discussion, the contrastivist may instead appeal to the speaker’s intention, to features of the assessor’s context, or even to features of the subject (of the ascription) or her context. As we have already seen, one prominent contrastivist, Walter Sinnott-Armstrong, argues for a very different solution to the problem of determining the contrast class. Sinnott-Armstrong (2004, 2006) argues that no way of determining relevance is correct, and that we should instead be relevance skeptics. We should simply suspend judgment about the content and truth of non-relativized claims employing a contrastive concept. Sinnott-Armstrong’s arguments are challenging, and if the contrastivist wants to avoid his skepticism, she needs to grapple with them. One way to gain traction here, though this goes beyond the scope of this article, is to seek independent evidence for the existence of a relevant question under discussion in explanations of natural language phenomena. Linguists have developed powerful explanatory theories of various natural language phenomena using questions under discussion. So even if specific proposals about how to determine the relevant contrast class, or question under discussion, face challenges, we at least have some reason to be optimistic that there is such a relevant contrast class or question.

A second and related challenge is that contrastivism delivers apparently objectionable results, as long as the relevant contrast class is set up in the right way. This problem is perhaps sharpest for the contrastivist about obligation. You may be obligated to do all kinds of terrible or crazy things, because the contrast class is crazy. For example, the contrastivist about obligation will say that you are obligated to burn down your neighbor’s house while she is at work—as long as the relevant alternatives are worse than this. So you are obligated to burn down her house while she is at work rather than burn it down with her inside. This is even more objectionable when we remember that these need not be the only options open to you—it may be perfectly possible for you to take her a plate of freshly baked cookies, or to simply stay at home and watch television, instead. Still, the contrastivist will say that you are obligated to burn down her house while she is at work, as long as the relevant alternative is burning it down with her inside.

The contrastivist about obligation is committed to this result, when paired with any plausible theory about what an agent is obligated to do out of a given contrast class. But it is not clear how serious this problem actually is. The explicitly contrastive claim, “You are obligated to burn down her house while she’s at work rather than burn it down when she’s inside” is not obviously false. After all, burning it down while she’s at work is clearly better than burning it down while she’s inside. The bare, non-contrastive claim, “You are obligated to burn down her house while she’s at work” does sound obviously false. But the contrastivist is only committed to the truth of this claim when the only relevant alternatives are things like “burn it down while she’s inside” (or even worse alternatives). In any ordinary context—for example, a context in which you could take her a plate of freshly baked cookies, instead—these will not be the only relevant alternatives. In fact, they are unlikely to be relevant alternatives at all, at least before they are mentioned. In these ordinary contexts, the contrastivist about obligation will not be committed to the truth of the objectionable non-contrastive claim. The details of this solution will depend on what our theory tells us about fixing the relevant set of alternatives, but it should be clear that the contrastivist has options here.

A closely related problem is raised against contrastive theories of moral reasons by Andrew Jordan. Jordan argues that some actions should be, and are, performed in a whole-hearted way—that is, without considering alternatives at all. The virtuous person will simply see that taking her sick pet to the vet is the thing to do and will not consider alternatives, or take into account reasons for alternatives, for example, the potentially high cost. So the reasons favoring the whole-hearted action do not seem to be relativized to any contrast class at all.

This problem only arises if the contrastivist about reasons holds that the contrast class is fixed by the options the subject is considering. But as we have seen, there are many more options for the contrastivist. It is not clear, for example, how this problem could arise on a speaker contextualist theory. So this is not a problem for the contrastivist as such.

Though these last two challenges are not serious problems for contrastivism as such, they are useful in thinking about the first challenge—that of saying what fixes the contrast class for a given claim. The problem of crazy verdicts resulting from crazy contrast classes puts pressure on a very simple version of speaker contextualism, according to which the relevant contrast class is wholly fixed by the speaker’s intentions. As long as the speaker intends a crazy contrast class, the objectionable ascriptions may come out true. This kind of contrastivist would then need to try to explain why this result is not actually objectionable. Jordan’s problem of whole-hearted action puts pressure on a version of contrastivism according to which the relevant contrast class is wholly determined by what the agent is considering—if the virtuous agent is not considering any alternatives, then this version of contrastivism could not supply a contrast class.

Another problem in this vein is harder to articulate in a sharp way. It stems from the idea that there must be an answer to whether the concept really applies, over and above whether it applies relative to any particular set of alternatives. In the case of “ought”, for example, there is a feeling that there must be something that we really ought to do. We can imagine the objector saying, in an exasperated tone, “I know I ought to take the bus rather than drive my SUV. What I want to know is, ought I take the bus?”. Read straightforwardly, this objection is just a rejection of the central thesis of contrastivism. Read in that way, there is not much the contrastivist can say.

There is another, more contrastivist-friendly way to construe this idea. The idea may be that, though there are lots of true claims about when I ought to or have reason to perform some action rather than some other action, in certain kinds of deliberation and theorizing, we are interested in “oughts” and in reasons with some kind of special status. The contrastivist can accommodate this idea by identifying special contrast classes, and claiming that they are relevant in the cases the objector has in mind. Some good candidates include (i) a trivial contrast class, {A, ~A}, (ii) an exhaustive contrast class that includes every possibility open to the agent, (iii) a maximally fine-grained contrast class, and (iv) a contrast class that makes all morally relevant distinctions. These are not mutually exclusive options, of course—for example, all four could be construed as exhaustive sets of alternatives. The contrastivist can hold that some reasons or obligations, for example, moral reasons or obligations, are always relativized to one of these special kinds of contrast class, while other reasons and obligations are not. This is all perfectly consistent with contrastivism, and lets us capture something very close to the idea that there is something we really ought to do or really have reason to do.

b. Cross-Context Inferences

A very different kind of challenge involves cross-context inferences. The central feature of contrastivism, that lets it solve puzzles facing non-contrastive theories, is that a concept may apply relative to one set of alternatives without applying relative to others. For example, just because we know that you ought to A rather than B, that does not tell us anything about whether you ought to A rather than C. This central feature leads to a very important challenge: sometimes, knowing that a concept applies relative to some alternatives should tell us whether it applies relative to certain other alternatives. For example, if I know that I ought to A rather than either of B or C (out of {A, B, C}), our theory should guarantee that I ought to A rather than B (out of {A, B}). Similarly, if I ought to A rather than B and I ought to B rather than C, then our theory should guarantee that I ought to A rather than C.

The advantages of contrastivism come from letting the application of a concept vary with the alternatives. What this problem shows is that we have to constrain this variation in certain ways. The strategy adopted by contrastivists who have addressed this problem is to appeal to some non-contrastive foundation on which the application of the concept depends. For example, contrastivists about “ought” who have addressed this problem appeal to a contrast-invariant ranking of alternatives, and let the application of “ought” depend on this ranking in ways that deliver the necessary constraints.

4. Conclusion

Contrastivism has been applied across much of philosophy, and it is no wonder why. It promises to resolve the closure paradox in epistemology, provide the best theory of explanation, perhaps the central concept in philosophy and science, and finally give a true theory of causation. And that is before we even broach the field of ethics. There, contrastivism promises to resolve—or at least shed serious light on—the paradoxes of deontic logic, the problem of determinism, and provide an account of reasons for action. There is much more work to be done in making good on these promises. But at the very least, this appears to be a very fruitful research program—especially in ethics, where less work has been done.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Baumann, P. 2008. “Problems for Sinnott-Armstrong’s Moral Contrastivism.” The Philosophical Quarterly 58(232): 463-470.
    • Argues that contrastivism about knowledge makes bad predictions in cases of “crazy contrast classes”.
  • Blaauw, M. (ed.) 2012. Contrastivism in Philosophy. Routledge.
    • A collection of papers demonstrating the breadth of the contrastivist program in philosophy, including several in ethics.
  • Cariani, F. 2013. “Ought and Resolution Semantics.” Noûs 47(3): 534-558.
    •  Develops a sophisticated contrastive semantic theory for “ought”.
  •  Chandler, J. 2007. “Solving the Tacking Problem with Contrast Classes.” British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 58(3): 489-502.
    • Uses contrastive confirmation to solve an important problem in confirmation theory.
  • Chandler, J. 2013. “Contrastive Confirmation: Some Competing Accounts.” Synthese 190(1): 129-138.
  • Craig, W. 1990. Knowledge and the State of Nature: An Essay in Conceptual Synthesis. Oxford University Press.
    • Argues that the central function of the concept of knowledge is to identify good sources of information, and develops a theory of knowledge based on this conception.
  •  Dretske, F. 1970. “Epistemic Operators.” Journal of Philosophy 67: 1007-1023.
    • Early version of the relevant alternatives theory of knowledge, direct predecessor of contrastivism.
  • Driver, J. 2012. “Luck and Fortune in Moral Evaluation.” In Blaauw (ed.), Contrastivism in Philosophy. Routledge, 154-172.
    • Sketches a contrastive account of luck, and applies it to the problem of moral luck.
  • Finlay, S. 2009. “Oughts and Ends.” Philosophical Studies 143(3): 315-340.
  • Finlay, S. 2014. Confusion of Tongues: A Theory of Normative Language. Oxford University Press.
    • Develops a theory of “ought” which makes use of contrastivist machinery in the service of providing a comprehensive theory of normativity.
  • Finlay, S. and Snedegar, J. 2014. “One Ought Too Many.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 89(1): 102-124.
    • Defends a uniform, propositional operator semantics for “ought”, making crucial use of contrastivism.
  • Fitelson, B. 2012. “Contrastive Bayesianism.” In Blaauw (ed.), Contrastivism in Philosophy. Routledge, 64-87.
    • Discussion of contrastive theories of confirmation.
  • van Fraassen, B. 1980. The Scientific Image. Oxford University Press.
    • Influential development of a contrastive theory of explanation.
  • Grice, H. P. 1989. “Logic and Conversation.” In Grice, Studies in the Way of Words. Harvard University Press, 22-40.
    • Classic discussion of conversational implicature, where speakers communicate more than they literally say.
  • Groenendijk, J. and Stokhof, M. 1997. “Questions.” In van Benthem, J. and ter Meulen, A. (eds.), Handbook of Logic and Language. Elsevier Science Publishers, 1055-1124.
    • Detailed discussion of the semantics of questions, including the partition/set of alternatives semantics.
  • Hamblin, C. L. 1958. “Questions.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 36: 159-168.
    • Early development of the partition semantics for questions.
  • Higginbotham, J. 1996. “The Semantics of Questions.” In Lappin, S. (ed.), The Handbook of Contemporary Semantic Theory. Oxford University Press, 361-383.
  • Hitchcock, C. 1996a. “The Role of Contrast in Causal and Explanatory Claims.” Synthese 107: 395-419.
  • Hitchcock, C. 1996b. “Farewell to Binary Causation.” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 26: 267-282.
    • Development of a contrastive theory of causation.
  • Jackson, F. 1985. “On the Semantics and Logic of Obligation.” Mind 94(374): 177-195.
    • Development of a contrastive theory of obligation, motivated by puzzles from deontic logic.
  • Jackson, F. and Pargetter, R. 1986. “Oughts, Options, and Actualism.” Philosophical Review 95(2): 233-255.
    • Development of a contrastive theory of obligation.
  • Jordan, A. 2014. "Whole-Hearted Motivation and Relevant Alternatives: A Problem for the Contrastivist Account of Moral Reasons." Ethical Theory and Moral Practice 17(5): 835-845.
  • Karjalainen, A. and Morton, A. 2003. “Contrastive Knowledge.” Philosophical Explorations 6(2): 74-89.
    • Argues for a contrastive conception of knowledge.
  • Lewis, D. 1996. “Elusive Knowledge.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74: 549-567.
    • Influential development of the relevant alternatives theory of knowledge, a direct predecessor of contrastivism about knowledge.
  • Lipton, P. 1990. “Contrastive Explanation.” Royal Institute for Philosophy Supplement 27: 247-266.
    • Development of a contrastive theory of explanation.
  • McNamara, P. 2014. “Deontic Logic.” In Zalta (ed.), Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • Detailed overview of deontic logic, including the puzzles that motivate contrastivism about obligation.
  • Morton, A. 2012. “Contrastive Knowledge.” In Blaauw (ed.), Contrastivism in Philosophy. Routledge, 101-115.
    • Gives primarily theoretical, rather than linguistic, arguments for contrastivism about knowledge.
  • Roberts, C. 2012. “Information Structure in Discourse: Towards an Integrated Formal Theory of Pragmatics.” Semantics and Pragmatics 5: 1-69.
    • Detailed development of a formal pragmatic theory making crucial use of questions under discussion.
  • Rooth, M. 1992. “A Theory of Focus Interpretation.” Natural Language Semantics 1: 75-116.
    • Develops a theory for interpreting focus (for example, intonational stress) in natural language, making crucial use of sets of alternatives.
  • Ross, J. 2009. Acceptance and Practical Reason. PhD Thesis, Rutgers University, Chapter 9.
    • Gives arguments for a contrastive treatment of normative reasons.
  • Schaffer, J. 2004. “From Contextualism to Contrastivism.” Philosophical Studies 119(1-2): 73-104.
    • Argues that contrastivism about knowledge is superior to standard forms of contextualism.
  • Schaffer, J. 2005a. “Contrastive Knowledge.” In Gendler and Hawthorne (eds.), Oxford Studies in Epistemology, Vol. 1. Oxford University Press, 235-271.
    • Argues for and develops a contrastive theory of knowledge.
  • Schaffer, J. 2005b. ‘Contrastive Causation.’ The Philosophical Review 114: 327-358.
    • Argues for and develops a contrastive theory of causation.
  • Schaffer, J. 2007a. “Knowing the Answer.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 75(2): 383-403.
    • Argues for and develops a contrastive theory of knowledge, based primarily on knowledge-wh ascriptions—for example, “knows who”, “knows whether”.
  • Schaffer, J. 2007b. “Closure, Contrast, and Answer.” Philosophical Studies 133(2): 233-255.
    • Shows how a contrastivist about knowledge can explain inferences supported by closure principles, even though the contrastivist has to reject standard closure principles.
  • Schaffer, J. 2008. “The Contrast-Sensitivity of Knowledge Ascriptions.” Social Epistemology 22(3): 235-245.
    • Argues against non-contrastivist treatments of the linguistic data used to motivate contrastivism.
  • Schaffer, J. 2010. “Contrastive Causation in the Law.” Legal Theory 16: 259-297.
    • Applies contrastivism about causation to causation as appealed to in judgments of legal responsibility.
  • Schaffer, J. 2012. “Causal Contextualisms.” In Blaauw (ed.), Contrastivism in Philosophy. Routledge, 35-63.
    • Discussion of contrastivism about causation, with a somewhat pessimistic conclusion for its ultimate prospects.
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, W. 2004. “Classy Pyrrhonism.” In W. Sinnott-Armstrong (ed.), Pyrrhonian Skepticism. Oxford University Press, 188-207.
    • Argues for contrastivism about knowledge, but uses this theory to support Pyrrhonian skepticism about unrelativized knowledge claims by arguing for skepticism about the notion of a “relevant” contrast class.
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, W. 2006. Moral Skepticisms. Oxford University Press.
    • Applies the ideas in Sinnott-Armstrong (2004) to moral epistemology.
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, W. 2008a. “A Contrastivist Manifesto.” Social Epistemology 22(3): 257-270.
    • An overview of contrastivism across philosophy.
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, W. 2008b. “Replies to Hough, Baumann, and Blaauw.” Philosophical Quarterly 58(232): 478-488.
    • Replies to Baumann’s (2008) “crazy contrast class” objection to contrastivism about knowledge.
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, W. 2012. “Free Contrastivism.” In Blaauw (ed.), Contrastivism in Philosophy. Routledge, 134-153.
    • Shows how a contrastive account of freedom can clarify disputes in discussions of determinism and moral responsibility.
  • Sloman, A. 1970. “Ought and Better.” Mind 79(315): 385-394.
    • Early development of a contrastive view of obligation.
  • Snedegar, J. 2012. “Contrastive Semantics for Deontic Modals.” In Blaauw (ed.), Contrastivism in Philosophy. Routledge, 116-133.
    • Argues for a contrastive treatment of deontic modals like “ought”, “must”, and “may”.
  • Snedegar, J. 2013a. “Negative Reason Existentials.” Thought 2(2): 108-116.
    • Shows how to use contrastivism to solve a puzzle about claims like “There’s no reason to cry over spilled milk.”
  • Snedegar, J. 2013b. “Reason Claims and Contrastivism about Reasons.” Philosophical Studies 166(2): 231-242.
    • Argues for contrastivism about normative reasons on the basis of reason claims employing “rather than”.
  • Snedegar, J. 2014a. “Deontic Reasoning across Contexts.” In F. Cariani, and others (eds.), Deontic Logic and Normative Systems, Vol. 12, Springer Lecture Notes in Computer Science, 2014a: 208-223.
    • Shows how a contrastivist about obligation can recapture intuitive inferences supported by inference rules the contrastivist rejects.
  • Snedegar, J. 2014b. “Contrastive Reasons and Promotion.” Ethics 125 (2014b): 39-63.
    • Argues for and develops a version of contrastivism, based on the idea that normative reasons are tied to the promotion of objectives.
  • Yalcin, S. 2011. “Nonfactualism about Epistemic Modality.” In Egan, A. and Weatherson, B. (eds.), Epistemic Modality. Oxford University Press, 295-332.
    • Introduces the idea of resolution-sensitivity in a discussion of epistemic modality.


Author Information

Justin Snedegar
University of St Andrews
United Kingdom

The Moral Permissibility of Punishment

The legal institution of punishment presents a distinctive moral challenge because it involves a state’s infliction of intentionally harsh, or burdensome, treatment on some of its members—treatment that typically would be considered morally impermissible. Most of us would agree, for instance, that it is typically impermissible to imprison people, to force them to pay monetary sanctions or engage in community service, or to execute them. The moral challenge of punishment, then, is to establish what (if anything) makes it permissible to subject those who have been convicted of crimes to such treatment.

Traditionally, justifications of punishment have been either consequentialist or retributivist. Consequentialist accounts contend that punishment is justified as a means to securing some valuable end—typically crime reduction, by deterring, incapacitating, or reforming offenders. Retributivism, by contrast, holds that punishment is an intrinsically appropriate (because deserved) response to criminal wrongdoing. Each type of account has been roundly criticized, on a variety of grounds, by theorists in the other camp. In an effort to break this impasse, scholars have attempted to find alternative strategies that incorporate certain consequentialist or retributivist elements but avoid the standard objections directed at each. Each of these accounts has, in turn, met with criticism. Finally, abolitionists argue that none of these defenses of punishment is satisfactory, and that the practice is morally impermissible; the salient question for abolitionists, then, is how else (if at all) society should respond to those forms of wrongdoing that we now punish.

This article first looks more closely at what punishment is; in particular, it examines the distinctive features of punishment in virtue of which it stands in need of justification. It then highlights various questions that a full justification of punishment would need to answer. With these questions in mind, the article considers the most prominent consequentialist, retributivist, and hybrid attempts at establishing punishment’s moral permissibility. Finally, it considers the abolitionist alternative.

Table of Contents

  1. What is Punishment?
  2. Various Questions
  3. Consequentialist Accounts
    1. Deterrence
    2. Incapacitation
    3. Offender Reform
    4. Sentencing
    5. Objections and Responses
  4. Retributivist Accounts
    1. Deserved Suffering
    2. Fair Play
    3. Censure
    4. Other Versions
    5. Sentencing
  5. Alternative Accounts
    1. Rights Forfeiture
    2. Consent
    3. Self-Defense
    4. Moral Education
    5. Hybrid Approaches
  6. Abolitionism
  7. References and Further Reading

1. What is Punishment?

When we consider whether punishment is morally permissible, it is important first to be clear about what it is that we are evaluating. Theorists disagree about a precise definition of punishment; nevertheless, we can identify a number of features that are commonly cited as elements of punishment.

First, it is generally accepted that punishment involves the infliction of a burden. The state confines people in jails and prisons, where liberties such as their freedom of movement and association, and their privacy, are heavily restricted. It imposes often heavy monetary sanctions or forces people to take part in community service work. It subjects people to periods of probation during which their movements and activities are closely supervised. In the most extreme cases, it executes people. Theorists disagree on precisely how to characterize this feature of punishment. Some describe punishment as essentially painful, or as involving the infliction of suffering, harsh treatment, or harm. Others instead write of punishment as involving the restriction of liberties. However we characterize the specific nature of the burden, it is relatively uncontroversial that punishment in its various forms is burdensome.

One might object that some prisoners could become accustomed to incarceration and so not see it as a burden, or that the masochist might even enjoy his corporal punishment. In response to supposed counterexamples such as these, a defender of the “burdensomeness” feature of punishment might argue that the comfortable prisoner and the masochist are still punished insofar as they are treated in ways that are typically regarded as burdensome by those on whom they are inflicted. Alternatively, one might argue that a particular case of incarceration, corporal punishment, and so forth, indeed does not count as punishment if the prisoner does not find it burdensome (Boonin, 2008: 8-10). Whatever one makes of these attempted counterexamples, it remains the case that punishment theorists by and large agree that burdensomeness is an essential feature of punishment.

But punishment is not merely burdensome. A second widely accepted feature of punishment is that it is intended to be burdensome. This feature distinguishes punishment from other forms of treatment that may be burdensome but are not intentionally so. Many people undoubtedly regard it as burdensome to pay their taxes, for instance, but presumably most do not regard this as a form of punishment. This is because although taxes may be foreseeably burdensome, they are not intentionally so. That is, the state does not levy taxes intending for them to be burdensome; rather, the intention is to pay for roads, an education system, and other public goods. That paying for these goods is burdensome to many taxpayers is incidental, and if there were a way to collect sufficient revenue to pay for needed public goods without this being a burden to taxpayers, then so much the better.

Punishment, however, is different. Punishment is intended to be burdensome. If it were not burdensome, then it would not be doing its job. For instance, as we will see below, some theorists contend that the aim of punishment is to reduce crime by deterring potential criminals. But for the threat of punishment to be the sort of thing likely to deter criminals, the punishment itself must be burdensome. Other theorists (retributivists) contend that wrongdoers deserve to suffer, and that punishment is justified as the infliction of this deserved suffering. Here again, the burdensomeness of punishment is not merely incidental, it is intended.

Of course, not all impositions of intended burdens count as punishment. A third commonly accepted feature of punishment is that it is imposed on someone guilty of an offense, as a response to that offense. Actually, there is some disagreement about this point. To count as punishment, must it be imposed on someone who is actually guilty of a crime? Or would it make sense to talk of punishing an innocent person (either mistakenly or intentionally)? Some scholars contend that punishment must be of a guilty person. Susan Dimock writes, “The innocent may be ‘victimized’ by the penal system, but they cannot be ‘punished’” (Dimock, 1997: 42). By contrast, H. L. A. Hart contends that we should acknowledge not only punishment of actual offenders, but also cases (which he calls “sub-standard or secondary”) of punishment “of persons…who neither are in fact nor supposed to be offenders” (see Hart, 1968: 5).

A fourth feature of punishment, widely acknowledged at least since the publication of Joel Feinberg’s seminal 1970 article “The Expressive Function of Punishment” is that it serves to express condemnation, or censure, of the offender for her offense. As Feinberg discusses, it is this condemning element that distinguishes punishment from what he calls “nonpunitive penalties” such as parking tickets, demotions, flunkings, and so forth. (Feinberg, 1965: 398-401). As we will see below, some scholars have taken this expression of censure to be central to the justification of punishment. But whether or not it plays a role in the justification of the practice, this expressive function is typically accepted as a distinctive feature of punishment.

Finally, it is worth highlighting that this article focuses on the legal institution of punishment—rather than, say, parents’ punishment of their children or other interpersonal cases of punishment (but see Zaibert, 2006). Legal theorists often assert as one of punishment’s features that it must be imposed by a properly constituted legal authority (typically, the state). They thereby aim to differentiate legal punishment from private vengeance or vigilantism. This does not mean we must accept uncritically that the state is the proper authority to impose punishment. Ideally, a full account of punishment should provide a plausible answer to why (or if) the state has an exclusive right to impose punishment.

These, then, are the most commonly cited features of punishment: punishment involves the state’s imposition of intended burdens—burdens that express social condemnation—on people (believed to be) guilty of crimes, in response to those crimes. This is not intended as a precise definition or a set of necessary and sufficient conditions for punishment. Theorists may disagree about particular elements, or especially about how exactly to flesh out the various elements. But this description is sufficient to give us a sense of why punishment stands in need of justification: It involves the state’s treating some of its members (imposing intentionally burdensome, censuring sanctions) in ways that typically would be morally impermissible.

2. Various Questions

When theorists ask whether punishment is justified, they typically assume a backdrop in which the legal system administering punishment is legitimate, and the criminal laws themselves are reasonably just. This is not to say that they assume that all legal systems are legitimate and all criminal laws are reasonably just in the actual world. Indeed, questions of political legitimacy and criminalization are important topics that have received a great deal of attention in their own right. But even in societies in which the legal system is legitimate and the laws are reasonably just, a general question arises of whether (and if so, why) it is permissible for the state to impose intended, censuring burdens on those who violate the laws.

This general question of punishment’s moral permissibility actually comprises a number of particular questions. A full normative account of punishment should provide answers to each of these questions.

First, there is the question of punishment’s function, or purpose. Put simply, what reason is there to want an institution of punishment? H. L. A. Hart referred to this as punishment’s “general justifying aim,” although this term may be misleading in two ways: on one hand, to say that the aim is justifying implies that it is sufficient, by itself, to establish punishment’s permissibility. As we will see, some scholars point out that more is needed to justify punishment than merely citing its function, no matter how valuable. On the other hand, talk of a justifying aim seems to privilege consequentialist accounts, according to which punishment is justified as a means to some socially valuable goal. But even for retributivist accounts, according to which punishment is justified not as a means to some end but rather as an intrinsically appropriate response to wrongdoing, we still need an explanation of why such a response is important enough to warrant the state’s institution of punishment. A first question, then, is what sufficiently important function punishment serves.

Even if we establish some sufficiently valuable function of punishment, this may not be enough to justify the practice. Some scholars contend that a crucial question is whether punishment violates the moral rights of those punished. If punishing offenders violates their rights, then it may be morally impermissible even if it serves some important function (Simmons, 1991; Wellman, 2009). What we need, according to this view, is an account of why, in principle, the practice of imposing intended burdens on people in the ways characteristic of punishment does not violate their moral rights.

In addition to justifying the practice of punishment in general, a complete account of punishment should also provide guidance in determining how to punish in particular cases. Even if the institution of punishment is morally permissible, a particular sentence may be impermissible if it is excessively harsh (or on some accounts, if it is too lenient). What principles and considerations should guide assessments of how severely to punish?

Relatedly, although this point has received less attention, we should ask not only about the appropriate severity of punishment but also about the proper mode of punishment. We may critique certain sentences not in virtue of their severity but because we believe the form of punishment (incarceration, capital punishment, and so forth) is in some sense inappropriate (Reiman, 1985; Moskos, 2011). What considerations, then, should guide assessments of whether imprisonment, fines, community service, probation, capital punishment, or some other form of punishment is the appropriate response to instances of criminal wrongdoing?

Finally, as mentioned, it is important to ask about the state’s role as the agent of punishment. Why is it the state’s right to impose punishment (if indeed it is)? Furthermore, what gives the state the exclusive right to punish (Wellman, 2009)? Why may victims not inflict punishment on their assailants (or hire someone to inflict the punishment)? Another question related to the proper agent of punishment—a question that has become increasingly salient in the decades following the Nuremberg trials—is when (if ever) the international community, rather than a particular state, can be the proper agent of punishment. What sorts of crime, and which criminals, are properly accountable to the institutions of international criminal law rather than (or perhaps in addition) to the domestic legal systems of particular states?

As we will see, various accounts of punishment focus on different questions. Also, some accounts seek to answer each of these questions by appealing to the same moral principles or considerations, whereas others appeal to different considerations in answering the different questions.

3. Consequentialist Accounts

Consequentialism holds that the rightness or wrongness of actions—or rules for action, or (relevant to our context) institutions—is determined solely by their consequences. Thus consequentialist accounts of punishment defend the practice as instrumentally valuable: the consequences of maintaining an institution of legal punishment, according to this view, are better than the consequences of not having such an institution. For many consequentialists, the burden of punishment itself is seen as a negative consequence—an “evil,” as Jeremy Bentham called it (Bentham, 1789: 158). Thus for punishment to be justified, it must be the case that it brings about other, sufficiently valuable consequences to outweigh its onerousness for the person on whom it is inflicted. Typically, punishment is defended as a necessary means to the socially valuable end of crime reduction, through deterrence, incapacitation, or offender reform.

a. Deterrence

Deterrence accounts contend that the threat of punishment serves as a disincentive for potential criminals. On such accounts, for the threat of punishment to be effective as a deterrent, it must be credible—it must have teeth, so to speak—and thus the legal system must follow through on the threat and impose punishment on those who violate laws. Theorists have distinguished two potential audiences for the deterrent threat: first, the threat of punishment might serve to dissuade members of the public generally from committing crimes that they might otherwise have committed. This is called general deterrence. Second, for those who do commit crimes and are subjected to punishment, the threat of future punishment (namely, the prospect of having to experience prison again, or pay further fines, and so forth) might provide a disincentive to reoffending. This is typically referred to as specific (or special) deterrence.

b. Incapacitation

Punishment might also help to reduce crime by incapacitating criminals. Unlike deterrence, incapacitation does not operate by dissuading potential offenders. Incapacitation instead aims to remove dangerous people from situations in which they could commit crimes. Imprisoning someone in a solitary confinement unit, for instance, may or may not convince her not to commit crimes in the future; but while she is locked up, she will be unable to commit (most) crimes.

c. Offender Reform

A third way in which punishment might help to reduce crime is by encouraging or facilitating offender reform. The aim of reform is like that of specific deterrence in one respect: both seek to induce a change in the offender’s behavior. That is, the aim for both is that she should choose not to reoffend. In this respect, both reform and specific deterrence differ from incapacitation, which is concerned with restricting rather than influencing offenders’ choices. But reform differs from specific deterrence in terms of the ways in which each seeks to induce different choices. Punishment aimed at specific deterrence provides prudential reasons: we impose onerous treatment on an offender in hopes that her aversion to undergoing such treatment again will convince her not to reoffend. Punishment with the aim of offender reform, by contrast, aims to reshape offenders’ moral motives and dispositions.

d. Sentencing

Each of these aims—deterrence, incapacitation, and reform—will have distinct implications with respect to sentencing. Punishment aimed at reducing crime through deterrence would in general need to be severe enough to provide members of the public with a significant incentive not to offend, or to provide offenders with an incentive not to reoffend. Also, as Bentham explained, the severity of sentences should reflect the relative seriousness of the crimes punished (Bentham, 1789: 168). More serious crimes should receive more severe punishments than do less serious crimes, so that prospective offenders, if they are going to commit one crime or the other, will have an incentive to choose the less serious crime.

For punishment aimed at reducing crime through incapacitation, sentences should be restrictive enough that dangerous offenders will be unable to victimize others (so, for instance, prison appears generally preferable to fines as a form of incapacitative punishment). In terms of duration, incapacitative sentences should last as long as the offender poses a genuine threat. Similarly, sentences aimed at reducing crime through offender reform should be tailored, in terms of the form, severity, and duration of punishment, in whatever ways are determined to be most conducive to this aim.

Finally, insofar as punishment itself is considered to be, in Bentham’s words, an “evil,” the consequentialist is committed to the view that sentences should be no more severe than is necessary to accomplish their aim. Thus whether she endorses deterrence, incapacitation, reform, or some other aim (or a combination of these), the consequentialist should also endorse a parsimony constraint on sentence severity (Tonry, 2011). After all, to impose sentences that are more severe than is necessary to accomplish punishment’s aim(s) would appear to be an infliction of gratuitous suffering—and so, from a consequentialist perspective, unjustified.

e. Objections and Responses

Typical consequentialist accounts of punishment contend that the practice is justified because it produces, on balance, positive consequences by helping to reduce crime, either through deterrence, incapacitation, or offender reform. Critics have objected to such consequentialist accounts on a number of grounds.

First, some have objected to deterrence accounts on grounds that punishment does not actually deter potential offenders. A key worry is that often (perhaps typically) those who commit crimes act impulsively or irrationally, rather than as efficient calculators of expected utility, and so they are not responsive to the threat of punishment. The question of whether punishment deters is an empirical one, and criminological studies on this question have come to different conclusions. In general, evidence seems to indicate that punishment does have some deterrent effect, but that the certainty of apprehension plays a greater deterrent role than does the severity of punishment (Nagin, 2013).

A similar line of objection has been raised against reform-based accounts of punishment. Criminological research in the 1970s led many scholars and practitioners to conclude that punishment did not, indeed could not, promote offender reform (the mantra “nothing works” was for many years ubiquitous in these discussions). More recent criminological work, however, has generated somewhat more optimism about the prospects for offender reform (Cullen, 2013).

Whereas critics have questioned whether punishment deters or facilitates offender reform, there is little doubt that punishment—especially incarceration—incapacitates (prisoners may still have opportunities to commit crimes, but their opportunities are at least significantly limited.) Critics have raised questions, however, about the link between incapacitation and crime reduction. For punishment to be justified on incapacitative grounds, after all, it would need to be the case not only that punishment in fact incapacitates, but that in so doing it helps to reduce crime. At least in some cases, there is reason to doubt whether the link between incapacitation and crime reduction holds. Most notably, locking up drug dealers or gang members does not appear to decrease drug- or gang-related crimes, because the incapacitated person is quickly and easily replaced by someone else (Tonry, 2006: 31-32).

Even if we accept, for argument’s sake, that punishment contributes to crime reduction, it still may not be justified on consequentialist grounds if it also generates costs that outweigh its benefits. The costs of punishment are not limited to the suffering or other burdens inflicted on offenders, although these burdens do matter from a consequentialist perspective. Scholars have also highlighted burdens associated with certain forms of punishment—in particular, incarceration—for offenders’ families and communities (Mauer and Chesney-Lind, 2002). These costs matter in consequentialist calculations. In addition, we must consider the financial costs of maintaining an institution of criminal punishment. In 2012, the Vera Institute of Justice released a study of 40 U.S. states that found that the total taxpayer cost of prisons in these states was $39 billion. Thus defenders of punishment on consequentialist grounds must show not only that punishment is beneficial, but also that its benefits are significant enough to outweigh its costs to offenders and to society generally.

Furthermore, even if punishment’s benefits outweigh its costs, consequentialists must make the case that these benefits cannot be achieved through some other, less burdensome response to crime. If there are alternatives to punishment that are equally effective in reducing crime but are less costly overall, then from a consequentialist perspective, these alternatives would be preferable (Boonin, 2008: 53, 264-67).

Suppose, however, that the benefits of punishment outweigh its harms and also that there are no alternatives to punishment that generate, on balance, better overall consequences. In this case, punishment would be justified from a consequentialist perspective. Many theorists, however, do not endorse consequentialism. Indeed, the most prominent philosophical objections to consequentialist accounts of punishment take aim specifically at supposed deficiencies of consequentialism itself.

Perhaps the most common objection to consequentialist accounts is that they are unable to provide principled grounds for ruling out punishment of the innocent. If there were ever a situation in which punishing an innocent person would promote the best consequences, then consequentialism appears committed to doing so. H. J. McCloskey imagines a case in which, in the wake of a heinous crime, a small-town sheriff must decide whether to frame and punish a person whom the townspeople believe to be guilty but the sheriff knows is innocent if doing so is the only way to prevent rioting by the townspeople (McCloskey, 1957: 468-69). If punishing the innocent person defuses the residents’ hostilities and prevents the riots—and thereby produces better overall consequences than continuing to search for the actual criminal—then it appears that the consequentialist is committed to punishing the innocent person. But knowingly punishing an innocent person strikes most of us as deeply unjust.

Consequentialists have responded to this objection in various ways. Some contend that what McCloskey describes is not actually punishment, because punishment, by definition, is a response to those guilty of crimes (or at least believed to be guilty, whereas in McCloskey’s example, the sheriff knows the person to be innocent). H. L. A. Hart refers to this response as the “definitional stop” and he suggests it is unhelpful because it seeks to define away the interesting normative questions. Setting terminology aside, the relevant questions are whether and why it is permissible to impose intended, condemnatory burdens on those (believed to be) guilty of crimes. The consequentialist’s response is that doing so produces the best consequences, but then it seems that the consequentialist should be committed to imposing such burdens on those not (believed to be) guilty of crimes when doing so produces the best consequences. Such a practice would strike many as morally wrong, however. Thus the objection arises for consequentialists regardless of definitions.

Others have responded to the objection that consequentialism would allow for punishing the innocent by suggesting that scenarios such as McCloskey suggests are so far-fetched that they are unlikely to occur in the real world. In actual cases, punishing the innocent will rarely, if ever, produce the best consequences. For instance, some contend that the sheriff in the example would likely be found out, and as a result the public would lose its trust in law enforcement officials; the long-term consequences, therefore, would be worse than if the sheriff had not punished the innocent person. As critics have pointed out, however, this response only shows that punishing the innocent will usually be ruled out by consequentialism. There might still be cases, albeit rare, in which punishing the innocent would generate the best consequences (maybe the sheriff is adept at covering up his act). At best, then, consequentialism seems only able to ground a contingent prohibition on punishing the innocent. Some consequentialists have accepted this implication, albeit reluctantly (see Smart, 1973: 69-73).

A similar objection to consequentialist accounts is that they cannot provide a principled basis for the widely held intuition that punishment should be no more severe than an offender deserves (where desert is the product of the seriousness of the offense and the offender’s culpability). On this view, it is morally wrong to subject those guilty of relatively minor crimes to harsh punishment; such punishment would be excessive. For consequentialist accounts, though, it appears that excessively harsh sentences would be permitted (indeed, required) if they produced the best overall consequences.

Jeremy Bentham contended that consequentialism does have the resources to ground relative proportionality in sentencing—that is, lesser offenses should receive less severe sentences than more serious offenses receive. His reasoning was that if sentences for minor offenses were as harsh as for more serious offenses, potential offenders would have no incentive to commit the lesser offense rather than the more serious one (Bentham, 1789: 168). If Bentham is right, then there is a consequentialist basis for punishing shoplifters, for instance, less harshly than armed robbers. But this does not rule out punishing shoplifters harshly (more harshly than most of us would think justified) and punishing armed robbers even more harshly; again, a consequentialist would seem committed to such a sentencing scheme if it promoted the best overall consequences.

Defenders of consequentialist sentencing have another response available, namely that excessively harsh sentences do not, in practice, produce the best consequences. For instance, criminological research suggests a) that stiffer sentences do not produce significant deterrent effects (it is primarily the certainty of punishment rather than its severity that deters); b) that extremely long prison terms are not justified on incapacitative grounds (for one reason, most offenders “age out” of criminal behavior anyway by their 30s or 40s); and c) that extremely harsh sentences may, on balance, have criminogenic effects (that is, they may make people more likely to reoffend). This sort of response, of course, makes the prohibition of disproportionate punishment a contingent matter; in other words, if extremely harsh sentences did help to reduce crime and this produced, on balance, the best overall consequences, then consequentialism would appear to endorse such sentences. Critics thus charge that consequentialist accounts are unappealing insofar as they are unable to ground more than a contingent prohibition on disproportionately harsh punishment.

Even if we prohibit punishment of the innocent or disproportionate punishment of the guilty, a third, Kantian objection holds that consequentialist punishment is not properly responsive to the person being punished. According to this objection, to punish offenders as a means to securing some valuable social end (namely, crime reduction) is to use them as mere means, rather than respecting them as ends in themselves (Kant, 1797: 473; Murphy, 1973).

In response to this objection, some scholars have contended that although consequentialists regard punishment as a means to an end, punishment does not treat offenders as mere means to this end. If we limit punishment to those who have been found guilty of crimes, then this treatment is arguably responsive to their choices and does not use them as mere means. Kant himself suggested that as long as we reserve punishment only for those found guilty of crimes, then it is permissible to punish with an eye toward potential benefits (Kant, 1797: 473).

A more recent objection to consequentialist systems of punishment, developed by R. A. Duff (1986, 2001), charges that consequentialist systems of punishment, with their focus on crime reduction, treat offenders as dangerous “outsiders”—as the “they” whom “we,” the law-abiding members of society, must threaten, incapacitate, or remold to ensure our safety. Such a conception of the criminal law is inappropriately exclusionary, Duff claims. The criminal law, and the institution of punishment, in a liberal polity should treat offenders inclusively, as (still) members of the community who despite having violated its values could, and should, nevertheless (re)commit to these values.

In response, one might object that systems of punishment aimed at crime reduction need not be exclusionary in the way Duff suggests. In particular, punishment that aims to deter crime might be said to treat all community members equally, namely as potential offenders. For those who have not committed crimes, deterrent punishment regards them as potential offenders and aims to provide an incentive not to offend (that is, general deterrence). For those who have committed crimes, deterrent punishment similarly regards them as potential (re)offenders and aims to provide an incentive not to (re)offend (that is, specific deterrence). In this way, punishment with a deterrent aim might be said to speak to all community members in the same terms, and thus not to be objectionably exclusionary.

4. Retributivist Accounts

As we have seen, consequentialist accounts of punishment are essentially forward-looking—punishment is said to be justified in virtue of the consequences it helps to produce. A different sort of account regards punishment as justified not because of what it brings about, but instead because it is an intrinsically appropriate response to crime. Accounts of the second sort have traditionally been described as retributivist. In general, we can say that retributivism views punishment as justified because it is deserved, although particular accounts differ about what exactly this means.

Theorists have distinguished two varieties of retributivism: positive retributivism and negative retributivism. Positive retributivism is typically characterized as the view that an offender’s desert provides a positive justifying reason for punishment; in other words, the state should punish those who are found guilty of criminal wrongdoing because they deserve it. Negative retributivism, by contrast, provides a constraint on punishment: punishment is justified only of those who deserve it. Because negative retributivism provides only a constraint on punishment, not a positive reason to punish, the negative retributive constraint has featured prominently in attempts at mixed accounts of punishment; such accounts allow punishment for consequentialist aims as long as the punishment is only of those who deserve it. On the other hand, because negative retributivism does not provide a positive justifying reason to punish, some scholars argue that it does not properly count as retributivism at all.

The distinction between retributivism and consequentialism is not always a neat one. Notice that one might endorse the claim that punishment is a deserved response to wrongdoing and then further assert that it is a valuable state of affairs when wrongdoers get the punishment they deserve—a state of affairs that therefore should be promoted. On this type of account, retribution itself essentially becomes the consequentialist aim of punishment (Moore, 1903; Zaibert, 2006). Nevertheless, in keeping with general practice, this article will treat retributivism as distinct from, and in competition with, consequentialist accounts.

a. Deserved Suffering

One common version of retributivism contends simply that wrongdoers deserve to suffer in proportion to their wrongdoing. Often this claim is made by way of appeal to intuitions about particular, usually heinous crimes: surely the unrepentant war criminal, for example, who has tortured and murdered many innocent people, deserves to suffer for what he has done. Proponents argue that retributivism is justified because it best accounts for our intuitions about particular cases such as these (Moore, 1987; Kleinig, 1973).

Justifying retributivism requires more, of course, than merely appealing to common intuitions about such cases. After all, even if many (even most) people do feel, in hearing reports of terrible crimes, that the perpetrators deserve to suffer, not everyone feels this way. And even those who do have such intuitions may not feel entirely comfortable with them. What we would like to know is whether the intuitions themselves are justified, or whether, for instance, they amount to an unhealthy desire for vengeance. Critics contend that those who rely on our intuitions about particular cases as evidence that retributivism is justified fail to provide the needed explanation of why the intuitions are justified.

There are other questions for such a view: does any sort of moral wrongdoing deserve to be met with suffering, or only some cases of wrongdoing? Which ones? And why is meting out deserved suffering for wrongdoing properly the concern of the state?

b. Fair Play

Another prominent type of retributivist account begins with a conception of society as a cooperative venture in which each member benefits when there is general compliance with the rules governing the venture. Because each of us benefits when everyone else plays by the rules, fairness dictates that we each have an obligation to reciprocate by playing by the rules, too. A criminal, like other members of society, benefits from general compliance with laws, but she fails to reciprocate by complying with the laws herself. She essentially becomes a free rider, because she counts on others to play by the rules that she violates. By failing to restrain herself appropriately, she gains an unfair advantage over others in society. The justification of punishment is that it corrects this unfair advantage by inflicting burdens on the offender proportionate to the benefit she gained by committing her crime (Morris, 1968).

On the fair play view, then, punishment is justified as a deserved response to an unfair advantage taken against members of society generally. Such an account offers a relatively straightforward answer to the question of why punishment is the state’s business. The state has an interest in assuring those who accept the burdens of compliance with the law that they will not be at a disadvantage to those who would free-ride on the system.

Critics of the fair play view have argued that it provides a counterintuitive conception of the crime to which punishment responds. It seems strange, for instance, to think of the wrong perpetrated by, say, a rapist as a sort of free-riding wrong against society in general, rather than an egregious wrong perpetrated against the victim in particular. In response to this charge, Dagger (1993) argues that crimes may be wrong in both senses: they may wrong particular victims in various ways, but they are also in every case wrongs in the sense of free riding on society generally.

c. Censure

Another influential version of retributivism begins with the claim, discussed earlier, that one of punishment’s distinctive features is that it communicates censure, or condemnation, of the offender for her offense. This retributivist account, developed most notably by R. A. Duff (1986, 2001), takes the censuring feature as the key to establishing punishment’s moral permissibility. Offenders deserve to be censured for what they have done, and punishment is justified because it delivers this censuring message.

Duff understands crimes as public wrongs, as violations of important public values. It follows on this account that the state is the appropriate agent of punishment; the state properly calls offenders to account for their violations of the political community’s shared values.

Censuring involves, in part, urging an offender to think about the wrong she has done, to repent and (re)commit herself to the values that she has violated. Thus it follows from censure accounts such as Duff’s that offender self-reform is an aim of punishment. But notice the crucial distinction between this sort of account and the variety of consequentialist account that aims at offender reform. Although offender reform is an aim of punishment on the censure account, it is not a justifying aim. In other words, on the censure view, punishment is not justified insofar as it tends to promote offender reform. Rather, punishment is justified because it communicates deserved censure. Part of what it means to censure, however, is to urge wrongdoers to repent and reform.

A common critique of the censure view asks why punishment—that is, the imposition of intended burdens—is the proper way to censure wrongdoers. It seems that the polity could communicate messages of censure to offenders without imposing intended burdens; for example, it could issue a public proclamation condemning the crime and blaming the offender. Why, then, is the hard treatment characteristic of punishment an appropriate vehicle for conveying such messages? One type of response, offered by Duff and others (see also Falls, 1987), holds that hard treatment is needed to convey adequately the polity’s condemnation of crimes. Nonpunitive censure—blaming without imposing intended hard treatment—would fail to communicate the seriousness of the wrongdoing.

Also, on Duff’s account, hard treatment can function to induce in offenders the sort of moral reflection that may lead to repentance, reform, and reconciliation (with their victims and the community more generally). Some have objected, however, that such an account implies too intrusive a role for the state. It is not a proper function of the state, critics charge, to seek to induce repentance and moral reform in offenders. Thus even some scholars who agree that punishment is justified as a form of censure nevertheless disagree about the role of the hard treatment element. For Andrew von Hirsch (1993), for instance, the intended burdens characteristic of punishment act as a sort of prudential supplement: punishment, as censure, serves to remind offenders (and community members) of the moral reasons to comply with the law. Punishment, as hard treatment, also provides a prudential threat as a sort of supplement for those of us for whom the moral message is not sufficient. One worry with such an account, however, is whether the prudential threat will tend to drown out the moral message.

d. Other Versions

Alternative versions of retributivism have been offered. Some scholars, for instance, argue that those who commit crimes violate the trust of their fellow community members. Trust, on this account, is an essential feature of a healthy community. Offenders undermine this trust when they victimize others. In such cases, punishment is a deserved response to such violations and an appropriate way to help maintain (or restore) the conditions of trust among community members (see Dimock, 1997). Advocates of this trust-based variety of retributivism must explain which violations of trust rise to the level that warrants criminalization, so that violators should be subject to punishment. Also, we might question whether such accounts are purely retributivist after all: if punishment is justified at least in part as a means of helping to maintain conditions of trust in a community, then this appears to be a consequentialist rationale. On the other hand, if punishment is justified not for what it helps to bring about but rather as an intrinsically appropriate (because deserved) response to violations of trust, then we need an explanation of why such violations deserve punishment, perhaps as opposed to some other form of response.

Another form of retributivism holds that offenders incur a moral debt to their victims, and so they deserve punishment as a way to repay this debt (McDermott, 2001). This moral debt is distinct from the material debt that an offender may incur. In other words, a person who robs from another person incurs a material debt equal to the value of whatever was stolen, but she also incurs a moral debt for violating the victim’s rights. The offender takes not only a material good from the victim but also a moral good. Repayment of material goods does not settle this moral debt, and so punishment is needed to fill this role. As Daniel McDermott characterizes it, punishment serves to deny the ill-gotten moral good to the perpetrator  (McDermott, 2001: 424).

Such an account raises a host of questions: what precisely is the nature of the moral good that has been taken from the victim? How can a moral good be taken away from someone? In what sense (if at all) has the perpetrator gained this good? How does punishment deny this good to the offender, and how does this thereby make things right for the victim?

e. Sentencing

Because retributivism claims that punishment is justified as a deserved response to wrongdoing, retributivist accounts should provide some guidance about what sentences are deserved in particular cases. Typically, retributivists hold that sentences should be no more severe than is deserved. This negative retributivist constraint on sentencing corresponds with the negative retributivist constraint on punishment itself (namely, that punishment is justified only of those who deserve it). By contrast, positive retributivism holds that offenders’ sentences should be no less severe than they deserve. Some scholars find this positive retributivism unappealing because it seems to preclude the state from taking into account mercy or other considerations that might count in favor of lenient sentences. In other words, some are more comfortable with retributivism’s setting a ceiling but not a floor on sentence severity. One question, though, is whether (and if so, why) retributivists are justified in endorsing the negative retributivist constraint on sentencing without also endorsing the positive retributivist constraint.

Retributivists often discuss sentencing in terms of proportionality, where a proportionate sentence is understood as one that is deserved (or at least, on some accounts, not clearly undeserved). Sentences may be proportionate in two senses: first, they may be proportionate (or disproportionate) relative to each other. This sense of proportionality, called ordinal proportionality, holds that similarly serious offenses should receive similarly severe punishments (like cases should be treated alike); that more serious offenses should be punished more harshly than less serious offenses (murder should be punished more harshly than shoplifting, for instance); and that differences in sentence severity should reflect differences in relative seriousness of offenses (because murder is much more serious than shoplifting, murder should carry a much more severe sentence).

Some scholars have challenged the notion of ordinal proportionality constraints in sentencing, both because offenders cannot neatly be distinguished into a manageable number of desert-based groups—Michael Tonry calls this the “illusion of ‘like-situated offenders’” (Tonry, 2011)—and because individual offenders’ subjective experiences of the same sentence may vary greatly. For example, someone who is young, physically imposing, or has no children may have a much different experience of a 10-year prison term from someone who is much older, physically frail, or must leave behind her children to serve the sentence. Considerations such as these do not in themselves demonstrate that the tenets of ordinal proportionality are false (that like cases should not be treated alike, for instance, or that more serious violations should not receive harsher sentences). Rather, these considerations raise challenges to our ability in practice to implement a just sentencing scheme that reflects ordinal proportionality.

Even if sentences can be devised that satisfy ordinal proportionality, however—in other words, even if a sentencing scheme itself is internally proportionate—particular sentences may fail to be proportionate if the entire sentencing scheme is too severe (or lenient). For instance, a sentencing scheme in which even the least offenses were punished with prison terms would appear disproportionate even if sentences in the scheme were proportionate relative to each other. Thus theorists note a second sense of proportionality: cardinal, or nonrelative, proportionality. Cardinal proportionality considers whether sentences are commensurate with the crimes they punish. A prison term for jaywalking would appear to violate cardinal proportionality, because such a sentence strikes us as too severe given the offense, even if this sentence were proportionate with other sentences in a sentencing scheme—that is, even if it satisfied ordinal proportionality. Thus cardinal proportionality concerns not the relation of sentences to one another, but instead the relation of a sentence to the crime to which it is a response. Put another way, even if an entire sentencing scheme is internally (ordinally) proportionate, we need guidance in how to anchor the sentencing scheme to the crimes themselves so that offenders in particular cases receive the sentences they deserve.

In addition to addressing questions of deserved sentence severity, we would like retributivism to provide some guidance about how to determine what mode, or form, of punishment is appropriate in response to a given crime. Is prison time, community service, capital punishment, probation, or something else the deserved form of response, and why?

The implications of retributivism for sentencing will depend on the specific account’s explanation of why punishment is said to be the deserved response to offending.

Those who appeal to intuitions that the guilty deserve to suffer, for instance, can similarly appeal to intuitions that those who are guilty of more serious offenses deserve to suffer more than those who are guilty of less serious offenses. As discussed, however, we would like to know how much punishment is deserved in particular cases in nonrelative terms, and also what form the suffering should take. One well-known account of sentencing is provided by lex talionis (that is, an eye for an eye, a tooth for a tooth). Immanuel Kant famously endorsed this principle: “Accordingly, whatever undeserved evil you inflict upon another within the people, that you inflict upon yourself” (Kant, 1797: 473). As critics have noted, though, not every crime appears to have an obvious like-for-like response—what would lex talionis demand for the childless kidnapper, for instance (Shafer-Landau, 2000: 193)? And even when a like-for-like response is clearly indicated, it will not always be palatable (torturing the torturer, for example).

We might assert instead that the sentence and the offense need not be alike in kind, but that the sentence should impose an amount of suffering equal to the harm done by the offender. Still, questions arise of how to make interpersonal comparisons of suffering. And again, for the most heinous crimes, a principle of inflicting equal amounts of suffering may recommend sentences that we would find troubling.

The fair play view holds that punishment functions to remove an unfair advantage gained by an offender relative to members of society generally. Critics of this view often object, however, that it provides insufficient or counterintuitive guidance about sentencing. Put simply, there does not seem to be any advantage that an offender gains, in proportion with the seriousness of her crime, relative to community members generally. On one version of the view, the offender gains freedom from the burden of self-constraint that others accept in complying with the particular law that the offender violates. If so, then the sentence severity should be proportionate to the burden others feel in complying with that law. But compliance with laws is often not a burden for most citizens. Indeed, it is often less burdensome to comply with prohibitions on serious offenses (murder, assault, and so forth) than it is to comply with prohibitions on lesser crimes (tax evasion, jaywalking, and so forth), given that we are more often tempted to commit the lesser crimes. But if the unfair advantage that punishment aims to remove is freedom from the burden of self-constraint, and if self-constraint is often more burdensome with lesser crimes, then these less serious crimes will often appear to merit relatively more severe punishments. This is a violation of ordinal proportionality.

Similar problems arise for other versions of the fair play view. Suppose, for instance, that the unfair advantage a criminal gains is not freedom from the burden of complying with the particular law she violates, but rather freedom from complying with the rule of law in general. This general compliance, Richard Dagger writes, is a genuine burden: “there are times for almost all of us when we would like to have the best of both worlds—that is, the freedom we enjoy under the rule of law plus freedom from the burden of obeying laws” (Dagger, 1993: 483). Critics have objected, however, that on this conception of the unfair advantage all offenses become, for the purposes of punishment, the same offense. Both the murderer’s and the tax cheat’s unfair advantage is freedom from compliance with the rule of law generally. If the unfair advantage is the same, however, then removing the advantage would seem to require equal sentences. Again, such sentencing appears to violate ordinal proportionality.

For the censure view, questions arise about what form of punishment and what severity will communicate the deserved message of condemnation in particular cases. On such a view, the principles of ordinal proportionality appear to follow straightforwardly: censure should reflect the seriousness of the wrongdoing, and so if punishment is the vehicle of communicating censure, then sentences should reflect the appropriate relative degree of censure for each case.

The censure view should provide guidance not only about how severely to punish crimes relative to each other, but also how severely to punish in absolute terms, and also the appropriate mode of punishment. To say that manslaughter should be censured more severely than theft, for instance, does not actually tell us how severely to censure manslaughter or theft, or with what form of punishment. Again, the challenge is in determining how to anchor the sentencing scale to actual offenses. Should the least serious offenses receive censure in the form of a small fine, a day in jail, or a year in jail? Should the most serious offenses receive capital punishment, life imprisonment, or some less severe sentence?

Similar questions arise for accounts that characterize punishment as a deserved response to violations of trust, or as a deserved response to the incurrence of a moral debt. What form and severity of punishment is appropriate to maintain conditions of community trust in response to attempted kidnapping, or the theft of a valuable piece of art? How severe must a sentence be to resolve the moral debt that is incurred when one impersonates a police officer, or cheats on her taxes?

Indeed, questions about fixing deserved sentences in response to particular offenses arise for retributivist accounts generally. Critics have charged that retributivism is unable to provide adequate, nonarbitrary guidance about either the deserved severity or deserved form of punishment in particular cases (see Shafer-Landau, 2000).

Retributivists are, of course, aware of such objections and have sought to meet them in various ways. Nonetheless, questions about proportionate sentencing continue to be a central challenge for retributivist accounts.

5. Alternative Accounts

In part as a response to objections commonly raised against consequentialist or retributivist views, a number of theorists have sought to develop alternative accounts of punishment.

a. Rights Forfeiture

At the outset, we said that the central question of punishment’s permissibility is why (if at all) it is permissible to treat those who have committed criminal offenses in ways that typically would be impermissible. For some theorists, this question is best cast in terms of rights: why are the sorts of intended burdens characteristic of punishment, which would constitute rights violations if imposed on those who have not been convicted of criminal wrongdoing, not violations of the rights of those punished?

One way in which punishment would not violate the rights of offenders is if, in committing the crime for which they are convicted, they forfeit the relevant right(s). Because offenders forfeit their right not to be punished, the state has no corresponding duty not to punish them. As W. D. Ross writes, “the offender, by violating the life or liberty or property of another, has lost his own right to have his life, liberty, or property respected, so that the state has no prima facie duty to spare him, as it has a prima facie duty to spare the innocent” (1930: 60-61).

Notice that the forfeiture view itself does not imply any particular positive justification of punishment; it merely purports to explain why punishing offenders does not violate their rights. This is consistent with maintaining that the positive justification of punishment is that it helps reduce crime, or conversely, that wrongdoers deserve to be punished. Thus the forfeiture view does not provide a complete account of the justification of punishment. Proponents, however, take this feature to be a virtue rather than a weakness of the view.

The forfeiture claim raises a number of key questions: first, why does someone who violates the law thereby forfeit the right not to be punished? For those who are gripped by the dilemma of why punishing offenders does not violate their rights, the mere answer that offenders forfeit their rights, without some deeper account of what this forfeiture amounts to, may seem inadequate. Thus some theorists attempt to ground their forfeiture claim in a more comprehensive moral or political theory (see, for instance, Morris, 1991).

Second, what is the nature of the rights forfeited? Do offenders forfeit the same rights they violate? If so, then this raises some of the same challenges as we saw with certain forms of retributivism: what right is forfeited by a childless kidnapper, for example? Alternatively, is the forfeited right simply the right not to be punished? If every offender forfeits this same, general right, then on what basis can we distinguish what sentence is permissible for different offenders? For example, if the burglar forfeits the same right as the murderer, then what prevents us from imposing the same punishment in each case (could two offenders forfeit the same right to different degrees, as some have suggested)?

Third, how should we determine the duration of the forfeiture? Fourth, if an offender forfeits her right against punishment, then why does the state maintain an exclusive right to punish? Why are other individuals not permitted to punish?

b. Consent

Rights forfeiture theorists argue that punishment does not violate offenders’ rights because offenders forfeit the relevant rights. Another way that punishment might be said not to violate offenders’ rights is if offenders waive their rights. This is the central claim of the consent view. Defended most notably by C. S. Nino (1983), the consent view holds that when a person voluntarily commits a crime while knowing the consequences of doing so, she effectively consents to these consequences. In doing so, she waives her right not to be subject to punishment. This is not to say that she explicitly consents to being punished, but rather that by her voluntary action she tacitly consents to be subject to what she knows are the consequences.

Like the forfeiture view, the consent view does not supply a positive justification for punishment. To say that a person consents to some treatment does not by itself provide us with a reason to treat her that way. So the consent view, like the forfeiture view, is compatible with consequentialist aims or with the claim that punishment is a deserved response to offending.

One challenge for the consent view is that it does not seem to justify punishment of offenders who do not know that their acts are subject to punishment. For someone to have consented to be subject to certain consequences of an act, she must know of these consequences. What’s more, even if an offender knows she is committing a punishable act, she might not know the extent of the punishment to which she is subject. If so, then it is not clear how she can be said to consent to her punishment. It is not clear, for example, that a robber who knows that robbery is a punishable offense but does not realize the severity of the punishment to which she will be subject thereby consents to her sentence.

By contrast, other critics have charged that the consent view cannot rule out sentences that most of us would find excessive. This is because a person who voluntarily commits an action with knowledge of the legal consequences, whatever these consequences happen to be, has consented to be subject to the consequences. As Larry Alexander has put it: “If the law imposes capital punishment for overparking, then one who voluntarily overparks ‘consents’ to be executed” (Alexander, 1986).

Another difficulty for the consent view is that tacit consent typically can be overridden by explicit denials of consent. Thus it would seem to follow that one who tacitly consents to be subject to punishment could override this tacit consent by explicitly denying that she consents. But of course, we do not think that an offender should be able to avoid punishment by explicitly refusing to consent to it (Boonin, 2008).

c. Self-Defense

Another proposed justification of punishment conceives of punishment as a form of societal self-defense. First consider self-defense in the interpersonal context: When an assailant attacks me, he culpably creates a situation in which harm will occur: either harm to me if I do not effectively defend myself or harm to him if I do. In such a circumstance, I am justified in acting so that the harm falls on my attacker rather than on me. Similarly, when an offender creates a situation in which either she or her victim will be harmed, the state is permitted to use force to ensure that the harm falls on the perpetrator rather than on the victim (Montague, 1995).

So far, this view appears to justify state intervention only to stop ongoing crimes or ward off impending crimes. How does this view justify punishment as a response to past crimes? Advocates of the view claim that the state is not only justified in intervening to stop actual offenses; it is also permitted to threaten the use of force to deter such crimes. For the threat to be credible and thus effective as a deterrent, however, the state will need to follow through on the threat in cases in which offenders are not deterred. Thus punishment of offenders is permissible.

Notice that although the self-defense account views punishment as a deterrent threat, it is not a pure consequentialist account. Crucial to punishment’s permissibility on the self-defense view is the claim that an offender has culpably created the circumstance in which harm will fall either on the perpetrator or the victim. This backward-looking element is missing from pure consequentialist accounts that cite punishment’s deterrent effects in defending the practice.

Critics object that the analogy between self-defense and punishment breaks down in a number of respects. First, many self-defense theorists argue that the logic of defensive force permits the use of such force even against “innocent” threats. But we do not typically believe that, by analogy, punishment of innocent people is permitted, even if such punishment helped to maintain the credibility of a deterrent threat. Second, the degree of force that is permitted to stop an actual attack may far exceed what we intuitively believe would be permitted as punishment of an offense that has already been committed.

Third, it is one thing to follow through on a threat in order to deter the person who has just offended from offending again. It is another thing—and one might argue, more difficult to justify—to punish one person in order to maintain a credible deterrent threat against the public generally. If we believe the primary deterrent effect of punishment is as a general deterrent (rather than as a specific deterrent), then the analogy with typical accounts of self-defense seems strained. It would be as if, to deter the oncoming assailant from following through with his attack, I grab someone nearby (who has previously attacked me) and inflict the same degree of harm that I would aim to inflict on the assailant to defend myself. This might, of course, be permissible if my previous attacker had thereby acquired a duty to protect me from future harm by allowing himself to be punished as a means of maintaining a credible deterrent threat (Tadros, 2011).

d. Moral Education

The moral education view shares certain features of consequentialist accounts as well as retributivist accounts. On this view, punishment is justified as a means of teaching a moral lesson to those who commit crimes (and perhaps to community members more generally, as well).

Like standard consequentialist accounts, the education view acknowledges that part of the story of punishment’s justification involves its importance in reducing crime. But the education theorist also takes seriously the worry expressed by many retributivists that aiming to shape people’s behavior merely by issuing threats is, in G. W. F. Hegel’s words, “much the same as when one raises a cane against a dog; a man is not treated in accordance with his dignity and honour, but as a dog” (Hegel, 1821: 36). By contrast, a central feature of the moral education view is that those who commit crimes are moral agents, capable of reflecting on and responding to moral reasons. Thus moral education theorists view punishment not as a means of conditioning people to behave in certain ways, but rather of “teaching the wrongdoer that the action she did (or wants to do) is forbidden because it is morally wrong and should not be done for that reason” (Hampton, 1984).

Another way to express this difference between the education view and standard consequentialist views is that consequentialist views focus entirely on whether punishment promotes some goal. The education view, however, holds that only certain means are appropriate for pursuing this goal: namely, punishment aims to engage with the offender as a moral agent, to teach her that (and why) her behavior was morally wrong, so that she will reform herself. Thus we can even distinguish the education view from consequentialist accounts that aim at crime reduction through offender reform. For such consequentialist accounts, punishment’s justification is solely a matter of whether, on balance, it promotes these ends. The education view sets offender reform as an end, but it also grounds certain constraints on how we may appropriately pursue this end.

The education view, like the retributive censure view discussed earlier, views punishment as a communicative enterprise. Punishment communicates to offenders (indeed, to the community more generally) that what they have done is wrong. Thus on both accounts, punishment aims to encourage offenders to reform themselves. But whereas the retributive censure theorists view the message conveyed by punishment as justified insofar as it is deserved, education theorists contend that punishment is justified in virtue of what it aims to accomplish. In this respect, the education view sits more comfortably with standard consequentialist accounts than with retributivist views.

The education view conceives of punishment as aiming to confer a benefit on the offender, the benefit of moral education. This is not to say that punishment is not burdensome; as we have seen, its burdensomeness is an essential feature of punishment. But the burdens of punishment are intended to be ultimately beneficial. Thus education theorists roundly reject accounts according to which it is permissible (or even required) to inflict harm on those guilty of wrongdoing. Instead, education theorists hold, following Plato, that we should never do harm to anyone, even those who have wronged us.

Critics have raised various objections to the moral education view. Some are skeptical about whether punishment is the most effective means of moral education. Others point out that many (perhaps most) offenders are not apparently in need of moral education: many offenders realize they are doing something wrong but do so anyway. Even those who do not realize this as they are acting may recognize it soon afterward. Thus they do not seem to need moral education. Finally, some object that the education view is inappropriately paternalistic. According to the education view, after all, the state is justified in coercively restricting offenders’ liberties as a means to conferring a benefit (moral education) on them. Many liberal theorists are uncomfortable, however, with the idea that the state may coerce a person for her own benefit.

e. Hybrid Approaches

Finally, some theorists have responded to seemingly intractable disputes between consequentialists and retributivists by contending that the question of punishment’s permissibility is not actually a single question at all. Instead, establishing punishment’s permissibility involves answering a number of questions: questions about the aim of the practice, about its limits, and so on. Once we distinguish different questions that bear on punishment’s permissibility, we can then recognize that these questions may be answered by appeal to different moral considerations. What emerges is a hybrid account of punishment’s permissibility.

The most famous articulation of a hybrid view comes from H. L. A. Hart (1968), although there have been numerous attempts to develop such accounts both before and after Hart. The specifics of these accounts vary somewhat, but in general the point has been to distinguish the question of punishment’s aim (Hart called this the “general justifying aim”) from the question of how we must constrain our pursuit of that aim. The first question, about punishment’s aim, is usually answered according to consequentialist considerations, whereas the second question, about appropriate constraints, is typically answered by appeal to retributivist principles. In other words, if we are asking what reason could justify society in maintaining a system of punishment, the answer will appeal to punishment’s role in reducing crime, and thereby protecting the safety and security of community members. But if we ask how we may punish in particular cases, the answer will appeal to retributivist principles about proportionality and desert. Some have distinguished these questions in terms of the proper (consequentialist) rationale of legislators in criminalizing certain types of behaviors and the proper (retributivist) rationale of judges in imposing sentences on those who violate the criminal laws.

Although such views are sometimes described as “two-question” or “two-level” views, with the focus on consequentialist aims and retributivist constraints, there is no reason in principle why we should distinguish only two questions. As we saw earlier, punishment actually raises a host of specific normative questions, and so if we accept the general strategy of distinguishing questions and answering them by appeal to different considerations, then there is no reason in principle to stop with only a two-level hybrid theory. A hybrid view might offer distinct considerations in answer to a variety of questions: what is the positive aim of punishment? Does punishment violate offenders’ rights? How severely may we punish in particular cases? What mode of punishment is permissible in particular cases? And so on.

Also, although hybrid theories typically follow the pattern of aims and constraints, so that consequentialism provides the reason to have an institution of punishment and retributivism provides constraints on how we punish, there is no reason in principle why this could not be reversed. A hybrid theory might hold that suffering is an intrinsically appropriate (deserved) response to wrongdoing, but then endorse as a constraint, for example, that such retributive punishment should never tend to undermine offender reform.

Critics have charged hybrid accounts with being ad hoc and unstable. Although we can distinguish different questions related to punishment’s permissibility, it is a mistake to think that the answers to these questions are entirely independent of each other, so that we can answer each by appeal to entirely distinct considerations. For example, if we accept the consequentialist view that punishment’s general justifying aim is that it helps to deter crime, then why would considerations of deterrence not also play a role (even a decisive role) in how severely we punish in particular cases? Why should retributivist proportionality considerations govern in sentencing if these conflict with the pursuit of crime reduction through deterrence?

Retributivists, for their part, often argue that hybrid theories such as Hart’s, on which consequentialism supplies the justifying aim of punishment, relegate retributivism to a peripheral role. Retributivists, after all, tend to regard consequentialism as providing inappropriate reasons to punish. Characterizing retributivism’s role as providing constraints on the pursuit of consequentialist aims is thus unsatisfying to many retributivists.

6. Abolitionism

Some scholars are unpersuaded by any of the standardly articulated justifications of punishment. In fact, they conclude that punishment is morally unjustified, and thus that the practice should be abolished. An obvious question for abolitionists, of course, is what (if anything) should take the place of punishment. That is, how should society respond to those who behave in ways (committing tax fraud, burglary, assault, and so on) that currently are subject to punishment?

One option would be to endorse a model of treatment rather than punishment. On this model, an offender is viewed as manifesting some form of disease or pathology, and the appropriate response is thus to try to treat and cure the person rather than to punish her. Treatment differs from punishment, first, because it need not be burdensome. At least in principle, treatment could be pleasant. In practice, of course, treatment may often be burdensome—indeed, it may involve many of the same sorts of restrictions and burdens as we find with punishment. But even though courses of treatment may be burdensome, treatment does not typically convey the condemnation that is characteristic of punishment. After all, we generally think of those who are sick as warranting sympathy or concern, not condemnation.

Other options for abolitionists would be to endorse some model of restitutive or restorative, rather than criminal, justice. We might require that offenders make restitution to their victims, as defendants in civil lawsuits are often required to make restitution to plaintiffs (Boonin, 2008: 213-75). Or offenders might engage with victims in a process of restorative justice, one in which both offenders and victims play an active role, with aims of repairing the harms done and restoring the relationships that have been damaged (Braithwaite, 1999). Neither the restitutive nor the restorative models are centrally concerned with imposing intended, censuring burdens on offenders.

Not surprisingly, these alternative accounts are themselves subject to various objections. Critics of the treatment model, for instance, charge that it provides insufficient limits on what sort of treatment of offenders is permissible. The aim of “curing” diseased individuals might warrant quite severe treatment, both in scope and duration. Similarly, scholars have argued that the treatment model fails properly to respect offenders, as it treats them merely as patients rather than as moral agents who are responsible, and should be held responsible, for their actions (Morris, 1968).

Critics of the restitutive and restorative models may point out that some crimes do not clearly lend themselves to restitution or restoration: some crimes may seem so heinous that no victim restitution or restoration of relationships is possible. Other crimes do not have clearly specifiable victims. In addition, consequentialists may worry that practices of restitution or restoration may be inadequate as means of crime reduction if, for example, they are less effective than punishment at deterring potential offenders. Retributivists also may argue that something important is lost when we respond to wrongdoing solely with restitutive or restorative practices. Particularly for those who hold that an important function of punishment is to convey societal censure, restitution or restoration may seem inadequate as responses to crime insofar as they are not essentially concerned with censuring offenders. Alternatively, some retributivists argue that the restorative ideals can best be served by a system of retributive punishment (Duff, 2001; Bennett, 2008).

7. References and Further Reading

  • Alexander, Larry (1986). “Consent, Punishment, and Proportionality.” Philosophy & Public Affairs 15:2, 178-82.
  • Bennett, Christopher (2008). The Apology Ritual: A Philosophical Theory of Punishment. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
  • Bentham, Jeremy (1789). An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation. Reprinted in J. H. Burns and H. L. A. Hart (eds.), The Collected Works of Jeremy Bentham: An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation. Oxford, Clarendon Press, 1996.
  • Boonin, David (2008). The Problem of Punishment. New York, Cambridge University Press.
  • Braithwaite, John (1999). “Restorative Justice: Assessing Optimistic and Pessimistic Accounts.” Crime and Justice 25, 1-127.
  • Cullen, Francis T. (2013). “Rehabilitation: Beyond Nothing Works.” Crime and Justice 42:1, 299-376.
  • Dagger, Richard (1993). “Playing Fair with Punishment.” Ethics 103, 473-88.
  • Dimock, Susan (1997). “Retributivism and Trust.” Law and Philosophy 16:1, 37-62.
  • Dolovich, Sharon (2009). “Cruelty, Prison Conditions, and the Eighth Amendment.” New York University Law Review 84:4, 881-979.
  • Duff, R. A. (2001). Punishment, Communication, and Community. Oxford, Oxford University Press.
  • Duff, R. A. (1986). Trials and Punishments. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
  • Falls, M. Margaret (1987). “Retribution, Reciprocity, and Respect for Persons.” Law and Philosophy 6, 25-51.
  • Feinberg, Joel (1965). “The Expressive Function of Punishment.” Monist 49:3, 397-423.
  • Goldman, Alan (1979). “The Paradox of Punishment.” Philosophy & Public Affairs 9:1, 42-58.
  • Hampton, Jean (1984). “The Moral Education Theory of Punishment.” Philosophy & Public Affairs 13, 208-38.
  • Hart, H. L. A. (1968). Punishment and Responsibility: Essays in the Philosophy of Law. New York, Oxford University Press.
  • Hegel, G. W. F. (1821). Philosophy of Right. Trans. S. W. Dyde. Reprinted by Dover Philosophical Classics, 2005.
  • Henrichson, Christian, and Ruth Delaney (2012). The Price of Prisons: What Incarceration Costs Taxpayers. Report of the Vera Institute of Justice, Center on Sentencing and Corrections.
  • Kant, Immanuel (1797). The Metaphysics of Morals. In Immanuel Kant, Practical Philosophy, trans. and ed. Mary J. Gregor. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Kleinig, John (1973). Punishment and Desert. The Hague, Martinus Nijhoff.
  • Lippke, Richard (2001). “Criminal Offenders and Right Forfeiture.” Journal of Social Philosophy 32:1, 78-89.
  • Mauer, Marc, and Meda Chesney-Lind (eds.) (2002). Invisible Punishment: The Collateral Consequences of Mass Imprisonment. The New Press, 2002.
  • McCloskey, H. J. (1957). “An Examination of Restricted Utilitarianism.” The Philosophical Review 66:4, 466-85.
  • McDermott, Daniel (2001). “The Permissibility of Punishment.” Law and Philosophy 20, 403-32.
  • Montague, Phillip (1995). Punishment as Societal Self-Defense. Lanham, Md., Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Moore, G. E. (1903). Principia Ethica. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
  • Moore, Michael S. (1987). “The moral worth of retribution.” In Ferdinand Schoeman (ed.), Responsibility, Character, and the Emotions: New Essays in Moral Psychology. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
  • Morris, Christopher (1991). “Punishment and Loss of Moral Standing.” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 21, 53-79.
  • Morris, Herbert (1968). “Persons and Punishment.” Monist 52, 475-501.
  • Moskos, Peter (2011). In Defense of Flogging. New York, Basic Books.
  • Murphy, Jeffrie G. (1973). “Marxism and Retribution.” Philosophy & Public Affairs 2:3, 217-43.
  • Nagin, Daniel S. (2013). “Deterrence in the Twenty-First Century.” Crime and Justice 42:1, 199-263.
  • Nino, C. S. (1983). “A Consensual Theory of Punishment.” Philosophy & Public Affairs 12:4, 289-306.
  • Plato (1997). Crito. In Plato: Complete Works Indianapolis, Hackett Publishing Company, Inc.
  • Reiman, Jeffrey H. (1985). “Justice, Civilization, and the Death Penalty: Answering van den Haag.”  Philosophy & Public Affairs 14:2, 115-48.
  • Ross, W. D. (1930). The Right and the Good. Oxford, Oxford University Press.
  • Shafer-Landau, Russ (2000). “Retributivism and Desert.” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 81, 189-214.
  • Simmons, John A. (1991). “Locke and the Right to Punish.” Philosophy & Public Affairs 20:4, 311-49.
  • Smart, J. J. C. (1973). “An outline of a system of utilitarian ethics.” In J. J. C. Smart and Bernard Williams (eds.), Utilitarianism: For and Against. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
  • Tadros, Victor (2011). The Ends of Harm: The Moral Foundations of Criminal Law. Oxford, Oxford University Press.
  • Tonry, Michael (2011). “Proportionality, Parsimony, and Interchangeability of Punishments.” In Michael Tonry (ed.), Why Punish? How Much? A Reader on Punishment. Oxford, Oxford University Press.
  • Tonry, Michael (2006). “Purposes and Functions of Sentencing.” Crime and Justice 34:1, 1-52.
  • Von Hirsch, Andrew (1993). Censure and Sanctions. Oxford, Oxford University Press.
  • Wellman, Christopher Heath (2009). “Rights and State Punishment.” Journal of Philosophy 106:8, 419-39.
  • Zaibert, Leo (2006). Punishment and Retribution. Aldershot, U.K., Ashgate.


Author Information

Zachary Hoskins
University of Nottingham
United Kingdom

Ethical Expressivism

Broadly speaking, the term “expressivism” refers to a family of views in the philosophy of language according to which the meanings of claims in a particular area of discourse are to be understood in terms of whatever non-cognitive mental states those claims are supposed to express. More specifically, an expressivist theory of claims in some area of discourse, D, will typically affirm both of the following theses. The first thesis—psychological non-cognitivism—states that claims in D express mental states that are characteristically non-cognitive. Non-cognitive states are often distinguished by their world-to-mind direction of fit, which contrasts with the mind-to-world direction of fit exhibited by cognitive states like beliefs. Some common examples of non-cognitive states are desires, emotions, pro- and con-attitudes, commitments, and so forth. According to the second thesis—semantic ideationalism—the meanings or semantic contents of claims in D are in some sense given by the mental states that those claims express. This is in contrast with more traditional propositional or truth-conditional approaches to meaning, according to which the meanings of claims are to be understood in terms of either their truth-conditions or the propositions that they express.

An expressivist theory of truth claims—that is, claims of the form “p is true”—might hold that (i) “p is true” expresses a certain measure of confidence in, or agreement with, p, and that (ii) whatever the relevant mental state, for example, agreement with p, that state just is the meaning of “p is true”. In other words, when we claim that p is true, we neither describe p as true nor report the fact that p is true; rather, we express some non-cognitive attitude toward p (see Strawson 1949). Similar expressivist treatments have been given to knowledge claims (Austin 1970; Chrisman 2012), probability claims (Barker 2006; Price 2011; Yalcin 2012), claims about causation (Coventry 2006; Price 2011), and even claims about what is funny (Gert 2002; Dreier 2009).

“Ethical expressivism”, then, is the name for any view according to which (i) ethical claims—that is, claims like “x is wrong”, “y is a good person”, and “z is a virtue”—express non-cognitive mental states, and (ii) these states make up the meanings of ethical claims. (I shall henceforth use the term “expressivism” to refer only to ethical expressivism, unless otherwise noted.) This article begins with a brief account of the history of expressivism, and an explanation of its main motivations. This is followed by a description of the famous Frege-Geach Problem, and of the role that it played in shaping contemporary versions of the view. While these contemporary expressivisms may avoid the problem as it was originally posed, recent work in metaethics suggests that Geach’s worries were really just symptoms of a much deeper problem, which can actually take many forms. After characterizing this deeper problem—the Continuity Problem—and some of its more noteworthy manifestations, the article explores a few recent trends in the literature on expressivism, including the advent of so-called “hybrid” expressivist views. See also "Non-Cognitivism in Ethics."

Table of Contents

  1. Expressivism and Non-Cognitivism: History and Motivations
  2. The Frege-Geach Problem and Hare’s Way Out
  3. The Expressivist Turn
  4. The Continuity Problem
    1. A Puzzle about Negation
    2. Making Sense of Attitude Ascriptions
    3. Saving the Differences
  5. Recent Trends
    1. Expressivists’ Attitude Problem
    2. Hybrid Theories
    3. Recent Work in Empirical Moral Psychology
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Expressivism and Non-Cognitivism: History and Motivations

The first and primary purpose of this section is to lay out a brief history of ethical expressivism, paying particular attention to its main motivations. In addition to this, the section will also answer a question that many have had about expressivism, namely: what is the difference between expressivism and “non-cognitivism”?

The difference is partly an historical one, such that a history of expressivism must begin with its non-cognitivist ancestry. Discussions of early non-cognitivism typically involve three figures in particular—A. J. Ayer, C. L. Stevenson, and R. M. Hare—and in that respect, this one will be no different. But rather than focusing upon the substance of their views, in this section, we will be more interested in the main considerations that motivated them to take up non-cognitivism in the first place. As we shall see, early non-cognitivist views were motivated mostly by two concerns: first, a desire to avoid unwanted ontological commitments, especially to a realm of “spooky,” irreducibly normative properties; and second, a desire to capture an apparently very close connection between sincere ethical claims and motivation.

In the case of Ayer, his motivation for defending a version of non-cognitivism was relatively clear, since he explains in the Introduction of the second edition of Language, Truth, and Logic (1946), “[I]n putting forward the theory I was concerned with maintaining the general consistency of my position [logical positivism].” As is well known, logical positivists were rather austere in their ontological accommodations, and happy to let the natural sciences decide (for the most part) what gets accommodated. In fact, a common way to interpret their verificationism is as a kind of method for avoiding unwanted ontological commitments—“unwanted” because they do not conform to what Ayer himself described as his and other positivists’ “radical empiricism.” Claims in some area of discourse are meaningful, in the ordinary sense of that term—which, for Ayer, is just to say that they express propositions—only if they are either analytic or empirically verifiable. Claims that are neither analytic nor empirically verifiable—like most religious claims, for instance—are meaningless; they might express something, but not propositions.

Ayer’s positivism could perhaps make room for moral properties as long as those properties were understood as literally nothing but the natural properties into which philosophers sometimes analyze them—for example, maximizing pleasure, since this is in principle verifiable—but it left no room at all for the irreducibly normative properties that some at the time took to be the very subject-matter of ethics (see Moore 1903). So in order to “maintain the general consistency of his position,” and to avoid any commitment to empirically unverifiable, irreducibly normative properties, Ayer’s positivism meant that he had to construe ordinary ethical claims as expressing something other than propositions. Moreover, for reasons unimportant to my purposes here, he argued that these claims express non-cognitive, motivational states of mind—in particular, emotions. It is for this reason that Ayer’s brand of non-cognitivism is often referred to as “emotivism”.

Stevenson likely shared some of Ayer’s ontological suspicions, but this pretty clearly is not what led him to non-cognitivism. Rather than being concerned to maintain the consistency of any pre-conceived philosophical principles, Stevenson begins by simply observing our ordinary practices of making ethical claims, and then he asks what kind of analysis of “good” is able to make the best sense out of these practices. For instance, in practice, he thinks ethical claims are made more to influence others than to inform them. In fact, in general, Stevenson seems especially impressed with what he called the “magnetism” of ethical claims—that is, their apparently close connection to people’s motivational states. But he thinks that other attempts to analyze “good” in terms of these motivational states have failed on two counts: (a) they make genuine ethical disagreement impossible, and (b) they compromise the autonomy of ethics, assigning ethical facts to the province of psychology, or sociology, or one of the natural sciences.

According to Stevenson, these other theories err in conceiving the connection between ethical claims and motivational states in terms of the former describing, or reporting, the latter—so that, for instance, the meaning of “Torture is wrong” consists in something like the proposition that I (the speaker) disapprove of torture. This is what led to problems (a) and (b) from above: two people who are merely describing or reporting their own attitudes toward torture cannot be genuinely disagreeing about its wrongness; and if the wrongness of torture were really just a matter of people’s attitudes toward it, then ethical inquiries could apparently be settled entirely by such means as introspection, psychoanalysis, or even just popular vote. Stevenson’s non-cognitivism, then, can be understood as an attempt to capture the relation between ethical claims and motivational states in a way that avoids these problems.

The solution, he thinks, is to allow that ethical claims have a different sort of meaning from ordinary descriptive claims. If ordinary descriptive claims have propositional meaning—that is, meaning that is a matter of the propositions they express—then ethical claims have what Stevenson called emotive meaning. “The emotive meaning of a word is a tendency of a word, arising through the history of its usage, to produce (result from) affective responses in people.  It is the immediate aura of feeling which hovers about a word” (Stevenson 1937, p.23; see also Ogden and Richards 1923, 125ff). A claim like “Torture is the subject of today’s debate” may get its meaning from a proposition, but the claim “Torture is wrong” has emotive meaning, in that its meaning is somehow to be understood in terms of the motivational states that it is typically used either to express or to arouse.

If Ayer and Stevenson apparently disagreed over the meaningfulness of ethical claims, with Ayer at times insisting that such claims are meaningless, and Stevenson allowing that they have a special kind of non-propositional meaning, they were nonetheless united in affirming a negative semantic thesis, sometimes called semantic non-factualism, according to which claims in some area of discourse—in this case, ethical claims—do not express propositions, and, consequently, do not have truth-conditions. Regardless of whether or not ethical claims are meaningful in some special sense, they are not meaningful in the same way that ordinary descriptive claims are meaningful, that is, in the sense of expressing propositions. Ayer and Stevenson were also apparently united in affirming what we earlier called psychological non-cognitivism. So as the term shall be used here, ‘ethical non-cognitivism’ names any view that combines semantic non-factualism and psychological non-cognitivism, with respect to ethical claims.

According to Hare, ethical claims actually have two kinds of meaning: descriptive and prescriptive. To call a thing “good” is both (a) to say or imply that it has some context-specific set of non-moral properties; this is the claim’s descriptive meaning, and (b) to commend the thing in virtue of these properties (this is the claim’s prescriptive meaning). But importantly, the prescriptive meaning of ethical claims is primary: the set of properties that I ascribe to a thing when calling it “good” varies from context to context, but in all contexts, I use “good” for the purpose of commendation. For Hare, then, ethical claims are used not to express emotions, or to excite the emotions of others, but rather to guide actions. They do this by taking the imperative mood. That is, they are first-and-foremost prescriptions. For this reason, Hare’s view is often called “prescriptivism”.

It may be less clear than it was in the case of Ayer and Stevenson whether Hare’s prescriptivism ought to count as a version of non-cognitivism. After all, it is not uncommon to suppose that sentences in the imperative mood still have propositional content. Since he rarely goes in for talk of “expression”, it is unclear whether Hare is a psychological non-cognitivist. However, it would nonetheless be fair to say that, since prescriptions do not have truth-conditions, Hare is committed to saying that the relationship between prescriptive ethical claims and propositions is fundamentally different from that between ordinary descriptive claims and propositions; and in this sense, it does seem as if he is committed to a form of semantic non-factualism. It also seems right to think that if we do not express any sort of non-cognitive, approving attitude toward a thing when we call it “good,” then we do not really commend it. So even if he is not explicit in his adherence to it, Hare does seem to accept some form of psychological non-cognitivism as well.

Also unclear are Hare’s motivations for being an ethical non-cognitivist. By the time Hare published The Language of Morals (1952), non-cognitivism was already the dominant view in moral philosophy. So there was much less of a need for Hare to motivate the view than there was for Ayer and Stevenson a couple decades earlier. Instead, Hare’s concern was mostly to give a more thorough articulation of the view than the other non-cognitivists had, and one sophisticated enough to avoid some of the problems that had already arisen for earlier versions of the view.

One thing that does appear to have motivated Hare’s non-cognitivism, however, is its ability to explain intuitions about moral supervenience. Most philosophers agree that there is some kind of relationship between a thing’s moral status and its non-moral features, such that two things cannot have different moral statuses without also having different non-moral features. This is roughly what it means to say that a thing’s moral features supervene upon its non-moral features. For example, if it is morally wrong for Stan to lie to his teacher, but not morally wrong for Stan to lie to his mother, then there must be some non-moral difference between the two actions that underlies and explains their moral difference, for example, something to do with Stan’s reasons for lying in each case. While non-philosophers may not be familiar with the term “supervenience”, the fact that we so often hold people accountable for judging like cases suggests that we do intuitively take the moral to supervene upon the non-moral.

Those philosophers, like Moore, who believe in irreducibly normative properties must explain how it is that, despite apparently not being reducible to non-moral properties, these properties are nonetheless able to supervene upon non-moral properties, which has proven to be an especially difficult task (see Blackburn 1988b). But non-cognitivists like Hare do not shoulder this difficult metaphysical burden. Instead, they explain intuitions about moral supervenience in terms of rational consistency. If Joan commends something in virtue of its non-moral properties, but then fails to commend something else with an identical set of properties, then she is inconsistent in her commendations, and thereby betrays a certain sort of irrationality. It is this simple expectation of rational consistency, and not some complicated thesis about the ontological relations that obtain between moral and non-moral properties, that explains our intuitions about moral supervenience.

Not long after Hare’s prescriptivism hit the scene, ethical non-cognitivism would be the target of an attack from Peter Geach. Given that the attack was premised upon a point made earlier by German philosopher Gottlob Frege, it has come to be known as the Frege-Geach Problem for non-cognitivism. In the next section, we will see what the Frege-Geach Problem is. Before doing so, however, let us briefly return to the question raised at the beginning of this section: what is the difference between expressivism and non-cognitivism?

In the introduction, we saw that ethical expressivism is essentially the combination of two theses concerning ethical claims: psychological non-cognitivism and semantic ideationalism. As we will see in Sections 2 and 3, the Frege-Geach Problem pressures the non-cognitivist to say more about the meanings of ethical claims than just the non-factualist thesis that they are not comprised of truth-evaluable propositions. It is partly in response to this pressure that contemporary non-cognitivists have been moved to accept semantic ideationalism. So the difference between expressivism and non-cognitivism is historical, but it is not merely historical.  Rather, the difference is substantive as well: both expressivists and non-cognitivists accept some form of psychological non-cognitivism; but whereas the earlier non-cognitivists accepted a negative thesis about the contents of ethical claims—essentially, a thesis about how ethical claims do not get their meanings—contemporary expressivists accept a positive thesis about how ethical claims do get their meanings: ethical claims mean what they do in virtue of the non-cognitive mental states they express. It should be noted, however, that there are still many philosophers who use the terms “non-cognitivism” and “expressivism” interchangeably.

2. The Frege-Geach Problem and Hare’s Way Out

Non-cognitivist theories have met with a number of objections throughout the years, but none as famous as the so-called Frege-Geach Problem. As a point of entry into the problem, observe that there are ordinary linguistic contexts in which it seems correct to say that a proposition is being asserted, and contexts in which it seems incorrect to say that a proposition is being asserted.  Consider the following two sentences:

(1)        It is snowing.

(2)        If it is snowing, then the kids will want to play outside.

In ordinary contexts, to make claim (1) is to assert that it is snowing. That is, when a speaker utters (1), she puts forward a certain proposition—in this case, the proposition that it is snowing—as true. Accordingly, if we happen to know that it is not snowing, it could be appropriate to say that the speaker is wrong.  But when a speaker utters (2), she does not thereby assert that it is snowing. Someone can coherently utter (2) without having any idea whether it is snowing, or even knowing that it is not snowing. In the event that it is not snowing, we should not then say that the speaker of (2) is wrong. However, whether “It is snowing” is being asserted or not, it surely means the same thing in the antecedent of (2) as it does in (1). Equally, while we should not say that the speaker of (2) is wrong if it happens not to be snowing, it would nonetheless be correct, in that event, to say that both (1) and the antecedent of (2) are false.

This is what Geach calls “the Frege point,” a reference to German philosopher Gottlob Frege: “A thought may have just the same content whether you assent to its truth or not; a proposition may occur in discourse now asserted, now unasserted, and yet be recognizably the same proposition” (Geach 1965, p.449). The best way to account for the facts that (a) claim (1) and the antecedent of (2) have the same semantic contents, and that (b) they are both apparently capable of truth and falsity, is to suppose that claim (1) and the antecedent of (2) both express the proposition that it is snowing. So apparently, a claim’s expressing a proposition is something wholly independent of what a speaker happens to be doing with the claim, e.g., whether asserting it or not.

Now, we should note two things about the theories of early non-cognitivists like Ayer, Stevenson, and Hare. First, they are meant only to apply to claims in the relevant area of discourse—in this case, ethical claims—and are not supposed to generalize to other sorts of claims. In other words, theirs are apparently specialized, or “local,” semantic theories. So, for instance, most ethical non-cognitivists would agree that claim (1) expresses the proposition that it is snowing, and that this accounts for the meaning of (1). Second, perhaps understandably, ethical non-cognitivists focus their theories almost entirely upon ethical claims when they are asserted. The basic question is always something like this: what really is going on when a speaker makes an assertion of the form ‘x is wrong’? Does the speaker thereby describe x as wrong? Or might it be a kind of fallacy to assume that the speaker is engaged in an act of description, based only upon the surface grammar of the sentence? Might she instead be doing something expressive or evocative? Geach observes, “Theory after theory has been put forward to the effect that predicating some term ‘P’—which is always taken to mean: predicating ‘P’ assertorically—is not describing an object as being P but some other ‘performance’; and the contrary view is labeled ‘the Descriptive Fallacy’” (Geach 1965, p.461). Little attention is paid to ethical claims in contexts where they are not being asserted.

The Frege-Geach Problem can be understood as a consequence of these two features of non-cognitivist theories. As we saw earlier with claims (1) and (2), when we embed a claim into an unasserted context, like the antecedent of a conditional, we effectively strip the claim of its assertoric force. Claim (1) is assertoric, but the antecedent of (2) is not, despite having the same semantic content. But as Geach points out, exactly the same phenomenon occurs when we take a claim at the heart of some non-cognitivist theory and embed it into an unasserted context. This is why the Frege-Geach Problem is sometimes called the Embedding Problem. For example, consider the following two claims, similar in form to claims (1) and (2):

(3)        Lying is wrong.

(4)        If lying is wrong, then getting your little brother to lie is wrong.

As with claims (1) and (2) above, the relationship between a speaker and claim (3) is importantly different from the relationship between a speaker and the antecedent of claim (4). At least in ordinary contexts, a speaker of (3) asserts that lying is wrong, whereas a speaker of (4) does no such thing. But, assuming “the Frege point” applies here as well, the semantic contents of (3) and the antecedent of (4) do not depend upon whether they are being asserted or not. In both cases, their contents ought to be the same; and therein lies the rub for ethical non-cognitivists.

Given that their theories are meant to apply only to ethical claims, and not to claims in other areas of discourse, non-cognitivists are apparently committed to telling a radically different story about the semantic content of (3), as compared to the propositional story they would presumably join everyone else in telling about the contents of claims like (1) and (2). But whatever story they tell about the content of (3), it is unclear how it could apply coherently to the antecedent of (4) as well. Take Ayer, for instance. According to Ayer, claim (3) is semantically no different from

(3’)      Lying!!

“where the shape and thickness of the exclamation marks show, by a suitable convention, that a special sort of moral disapproval is the feeling which is being expressed” (Ayer (1946)1952, p.107). Ayer believed that speakers of claims like (3) are not engaged in acts of description, but rather acts of expressing their non-cognitive attitudes toward various things. This is how Ayer’s theory treats the contents of ethical claims when they are asserted. Now, absent some independently compelling reason for thinking that “the Frege point” should not apply here, the same analysis ought to be given to the antecedent of (4). But the same analysis cannot be given to the antecedent of (4). For, just as a speaker can sincerely and coherently utter (2) without believing that it is snowing, a speaker can sincerely and coherently utter (4) without disapproving of lying. So whatever Ayer has to say about the content of the antecedent of (4), it cannot be that it consists in the expression of “a special sort of moral disapproval,” since a speaker of (4) does not express disapproval of lying. Apparently, then, he is committed to saying, counter-intuitively, that the contents of (3) and the antecedent of (4) are different.

As Geach poses it, the problem for the ethical non-cognitivist at this point is actually two-fold (see especially Geach 1965: 462-465). First, the non-cognitivist must explain how ethical claims are able to function as premises in logical inferences in the first place, if they do not express propositions. Traditionally, inference in logic is thought to be a matter of the truth-conditional relations that hold between propositions, and logical connectives like “and”, “or”, and “if-then” are thought to be truth-preserving functions from propositions to propositions. But as we have already seen, ethical non-cognitivists deny that ethical claims are even in the business of expressing propositions. So how, Geach wonders, are we apparently able to infer

(5)        Therefore, getting your little brother to lie is wrong

from (3) and (4), if the content of (3) is nothing more than an attitude of disapproval toward lying?  Or consider:

(6)        Lying is wrong or it isn’t.

Claim (6) can be inferred from (3) by a familiar logical principle, and in non-ethical contexts, we account for this by explaining how disjunction relates two or more propositions. But how can someone who denies that (3) expresses a proposition explain the relationship between (3) and (6)? The second part of the problem, related to the first, is that the non-cognitivist must explain why the inference from (3) and (4) to (5), for instance, is a valid one. As any introductory logic student knows well, the validity of modus ponens depends upon the minor premise and the antecedent of the major premise having the same content. Otherwise, the argument equivocates, and the inference is invalid. But as we just saw, on the theories of non-cognitivists like Ayer, claim (3) and the antecedent of (4) apparently do not have the same content. So Ayer seems committed to saying that what appears to be a straightforward instance of modus ponens is in fact an invalid argument. This is the so-called Frege-Geach Problem for non-cognitivism as Geach originally put it.

In response to an argument very much like Geach’s (see Searle 1962), Hare appears to give non-cognitivists a “way out” of the Frege-Geach Problem (Hare 1970). As Hare sees it, the matter ultimately comes down to whether or not the non-cognitivist can adequately account for the compositionality of language, that is, the way the meanings of complex sentences are composed of the meanings of their simpler parts. As has already been noted, linguists and philosophers of language have traditionally done this by telling a story about propositions and the various relations that may hold between them—the meaning of (2), for instance, is composed of (a) the proposition that it is snowing, (b) the proposition that the kids will want to play outside, and (c) the conditional function “if-then”. The challenge for the non-cognitivist is simply to find another way to account for compositionality—though, it turns out, this is no simple matter.

Hare’s own proposal was to think of the meanings of ethical claims in terms of the sorts of acts for which they are suited and not in terms of propositions or mental states. The claim “Lying is wrong,” for instance, is especially suited for a particular sort of act, namely, the act of condemning lying. Thinking of the meanings of ethical claims in this way allows Hare and other non-cognitivists to effectively concede “the Frege point,” since suitability for an act is something wholly independent of whether a claim is being asserted or not. It allows them, for instance, to say that the content of (3) is the same as the content of the antecedent of (4), which, we saw, was a problem for theories like Ayer’s. From here, accounting for the meanings of complex ethical claims, like (4) and (6), is a matter of conceiving logical connectives not as functions from propositions to propositions, but rather as functions from speech acts to speech acts. If non-cognitivists could do something like this, that is, draw up a kind of “logic of speech acts”, then they would apparently have the resources for meeting both of Geach’s challenges. They could explain how ethical claims can function as premises in logical inferences, and they could explain why some of those inferences, and not others, are valid. Unfortunately, Hare himself stopped short of working out such a logic, but his 1970 paper would nonetheless pave the way for future expressivist theories and their own responses to the Frege-Geach Problem.

3. The Expressivist Turn

Earlier, it was noted that the difference between non-cognitivism and expressivism is both historical and substantive. To repeat, ethical non-cognitivists were united in affirming the negative semantic thesis that ethical claims do not get their meanings from truth-evaluable propositions, as in semantic non-factualism. But as we have already seen with Hare, the Frege-Geach Problem pressures non-cognitivists to say something more than this, in order to account for the meanings of both simple and complex ethical claims, and to explain how some ethical claims can be inferred from others.

Contemporary ethical expressivists respond to this pressure by doing just that: while still affirming the semantic non-factualism of their non-cognitivist ancestors, expressivists nowadays add to this the thesis that was earlier called semantic ideationalism. That is, they think that the meanings of ethical claims are constituted not by propositions, but by the very non-cognitive mental states that they have long been thought to express. In other words, if non-cognitivists “removed” propositions from the contents of ethical claims, then expressivists “replace” those propositions with mental states, or “ideas”—hence, ideationalism. It is this move, made primarily in response to the Frege-Geach Problem, and by following Hare’s lead, that constitutes the historical turn from ethical non-cognitivism to ethical expressivism. Both non-cognitivists and expressivists believe that ethical claims express non-cognitive attitudes, but expressivists are distinguished in thinking of the expression relation itself as a semantic one.

Ethical expressivism is often contrasted with another theory of the meanings of ethical claims according to which those meanings are closely related with speaker’s non-cognitive states of mind, namely, ethical subjectivism. Ethical subjectivism can be understood as the view that the meanings of ethical claims are propositions, but propositions about speakers’ attitudes. So whatever the relationship between claim (1) above and the proposition that it is snowing, the same relationship holds between claim (3) and the proposition that I (the speaker) disapprove of lying. So ethical subjectivists can also, with expressivists, say that ethical claims mean what they do in virtue of the non-cognitive states that they express. But whereas the expressivist accounts for this in terms of the way the claim itself directly expresses the relevant state, the subjectivist accounts for it in terms of the speaker indirectly expressing the relevant state by expressing a proposition that refers to it.

The contrast between expressivism and subjectivism is important not only for the purpose of understanding what expressivism is, but also for seeing a significant advantage that it is supposed to have over subjectivism. Suppose Jones and Smith are engaged in a debate about the wrongness of lying, with Jones claiming that it is wrong, and Smith claiming that it is not wrong.  Presumably, for this to count as a genuine disagreement, it must be the case that their claims have incompatible contents. But according to subjectivism, the contents of their claims, respectively, are the propositions that I (Jones) disapprove of lying and that I (Smith) do not disapprove of lying. Clearly, though, these two propositions are perfectly compatible with each other. Where, then, where is the disagreement? This is often thought to be a particularly devastating problem for ethical subjectivism, that is, it cannot adequately account for genuine moral disagreement, but it is apparently not a problem for expressivists. According to expressivism, the disagreement is simply a matter of Jones and Smith directly expressing incompatible states of mind.  This is one of the advantages of supposing that the semantic contents of ethical claims just are mental states, and not propositions about mental states.

Now, recall the two motivations that first led people to accept ethical non-cognitivism. The first was a desire to avoid any ontological commitment to “spooky,” irreducibly normative properties. Moral realists, roughly speaking, are those who believe that properties like goodness and wrongness have every bit the ontological status as other, less controversial properties, like roundness and solidity, that is, moral properties are no less “real” than non-moral properties. But especially for those philosophers committed to a thoroughgoing metaphysical naturalism, it is hard to see how things like goodness and wrongness could have such a status. Especially when it is noted, as Mackie famously does, that moral properties as realists typically conceive them are somehow supposed to have a kind of built-in capacity to motivate those who apprehend them, to say nothing of how they are supposed to be apprehended, a capacity apparently not had by any other property (see Mackie 1977, p.38-42). Ethical expressivists avoid this problem by denying that people who make ethical claims are even engaged in the task of ascribing moral properties to things in the first place. Ontologically speaking, expressivism demands little more of the world than people’s attitudes and the speakers who express them, and so, it nicely satisfies the first of the two non-cognitivist desiderata.

The second desideratum was a desire to accommodate an apparently very close connection between ethical claims and motivation. In simple terms, motivational internalism is the view that a necessary condition for moral judgment is that the speaker be motivated to act accordingly. In other words, if Jones judges that lying is wrong, but has no motivation whatsoever to refrain from lying, or to condemn those who lie, or whatever, then internalists will typically say that Jones must not really judge lying to be wrong. Even if motivational internalism is false, though, it is surely right that we expect people’s ethical claims to be accompanied by motivations to act in certain ways; and when people who make ethical claims seem not to be motivated to act in these ways, we often assume either that they are being insincere or that something else has gone wrong. Sincere ethical claims just seem to “come with” corresponding motivations. Here, too, expressivism seems well suited to account for this feature of ethical claims, since they take ethical claims to directly express non-cognitive states of mind, for example, desires, emotions, attitudes, commitments, and these states are either capable of motivating by themselves, or at least closely tied to motivation. So while ethical expressivists distinguish themselves from earlier non-cognitivists by accepting the thesis of semantic ideationalism, they are no less capable of accommodating the very same considerations that motivated non-cognitivism in the first place.

Finally, return to the Frege-Geach Problem. As we saw in the previous section, Geach originally posed it as a kind of logical problem for non-cognitivists: by denying that claims in the relevant area of discourse express propositions, non-cognitivists take on the burden of explaining how such claims can be involved in logical inference, and why some such inferences are valid and others invalid. Hare took a first step toward meeting this challenge by proposing that we understand the contents of ethical claims in terms of speech acts, and then work out a kind of “logic” of speech acts. Contemporary expressivists, since they understand the contents of ethical claims not in terms of speech acts but in terms of mental states, are committed to doing something similar with whatever non-cognitive states they think are expressed by these claims. In other words, as it is sometimes put, expressivists owe us a kind of “logic of attitudes.”

Here, again, is our test case:

(3)        Lying is wrong.

(4)        If lying is wrong, then getting your little brother to lie is wrong.

(5)        Therefore, getting your little brother to lie is wrong.

If the meanings of (3), (4), and (5) are to be understood solely in terms of mental states, and not in terms of propositions, how is it that we can infer (5) from (3) and (4)? And why is the inference valid?

In some of his earlier work on this, Blackburn (1984) answers these questions by suggesting that complex ethical claims like (4) express higher-order non-cognitive states, in this case, something like a commitment to disapproving of getting one’s little brother to lie upon disapproving of lying. If someone sincerely disapproves of lying, and is also committed to disapproving of getting her little brother to lie as long as she disapproves of lying—the two states expressed by (3) and (4), respectively—then she thereby commits herself to disapproving of getting her little brother to lie. This is one sense in which (5) might “follow from” (3) and (4), even if it is not exactly the entailment relation with which we are all familiar from introductory logic.

Furthermore, a familiar way to account for the validity of inferences like (3)-(5) is by saying that it is impossible for the premises to be true and for the conclusion to be false. But if the expressivist takes something like the approach under consideration here, he will presumably have to say something different, since it is certainly possible for someone to hold both of the attitudes expressed by (3) and (4) without also holding the attitude expressed by (5). So for instance, the expressivist might say something like this: while a person certainly can hold the attitudes expressed by (3) and (4) without also holding the attitude expressed by (5), such a person would nonetheless exhibit a kind of inconsistency in her attitudes—she would have what Blackburn calls a “fractured sensibility” (1984: 195). It is this inconsistency that might explain why the move from (3) and (4) to (5) is “valid,” provided that we allow for this alternative sense of validity. Recall, that this is essentially the same sort of inconsistency of attitudes that Hare thought underlies our intuitions about moral supervenience.

This is just one way in which expressivists might attempt to solve the Frege-Geach Problem.  Others have attempted different sorts of “logics of attitudes,” with mixed results. In early twenty-first century discourse, the debate about whether such a thing as a “logic of attitudes” is even possible—and if so, what it should look like—is ongoing.

4. The Continuity Problem

Even if expressivists can solve, or at least avoid, the Frege-Geach Problem as Geach originally posed it, there is a deeper problem that they face, a kind of “problem behind the problem”, and that will be the subject of this section. To get a sense of the problem, consider that expressivists have taken a position that effectively pulls them in two opposing directions. On the one hand, since the earliest days of non-cognitivism, philosophers in the expressivist tradition have wanted to draw some sort of sharp contrast between claims in the relevant area of discourse and claims outside of that area of discourse, that is, between ethical and non-ethical claims. But on the other hand, and this is the deeper issue that one might think lies behind the Frege-Geach Problem, ethical claims seem to behave in all sorts of logical and semantic contexts just like their non-ethical counterparts. Ethical claims are apparently no different from non-ethical claims in being (a) embeddable into unasserted contexts, like disjunctions and the antecedents of conditionals, (b) involved in logical inferences, (c) posed as questions, (d) translated across different languages, (e) negated, (f) supported with reasons, and (g) used to articulate the objects of various states of mind, for example, we can say that Jones believes that lying is wrong, Anderson regrets that lying is wrong, and Black wonders whether lying is wrong, to name just a few. It is in accounting for the many apparent continuities between ethical and non-ethical claims that expressivists run into serious problems. So call the general problem here the Continuity Problem for expressivism.

One very significant step that expressivists have taken in order to solve the Continuity Problem is to expand their semantic ideationalism to apply to claims of all sorts, and not just to claims in the relevant area of discourse. So, in the same way that ethical claims get their meanings from non-cognitive mental states, non-ethical claims get their meanings from whatever states of mind they express. In other words, expressivists attempt to solve the Continuity Problem by swapping their “local” semantic ideationalism, that is, ideationalism specifically with respect to claims in the discourse of concern, for a more “global” ideationalist semantics intended to apply to claims in all areas of discourse. This is remarkable, as it represents a wholesale departure from the more traditional propositionalist semantics according to which sentences mean what they do in virtue of the propositions they express. Recall the earlier claims:

(1)        It is snowing.

(3)        Lying is wrong.

According to most contemporary expressivists, the meanings of both (1) and (3) are to be understood in terms of the mental states they express.  Claim (3) expresses something like disapproval of lying, and claim (1) expresses the belief that it is snowing, as opposed to the proposition that it is snowing. So even if ethical and non-ethical claims express different kinds of states, their meanings are nonetheless accounted for in the same way, that is, in terms of whatever mental states the relevant claims are supposed to express.

If nothing else, this promises to be an important first step toward solving the Continuity Problem. But taking this step, from local to global semantic ideationalism, may prove to be more trouble than it is worth, as it appears to raise all sorts of other problems a few of which we shall consider here under the general banner of the Continuity Problem.

a. A Puzzle about Negation

Keeping in mind that expressivism now appears to hinge upon it being the case that an ideationalist approach to semantics can account for all of the same logical and linguistic phenomena that the more traditional propositional or truth-conditional approaches to semantics can account for, consider a simple case of negation:

(1)        It is snowing.

(7)        It is not snowing.

On an ideationalist approach to meaning, (1) gets its meaning from the belief that it is snowing, and (7) gets its meaning from either the belief that it is not snowing, or perhaps a state of disbelief that it is snowing, assuming, for now, that a state of disbelief is something different from a mere lack of belief. A claim and its negation ought to have incompatible contents, and this is apparently how an ideationalist would account for the incompatibility of (1) and (7). But now consider a case of an ethical claim and its negation:

(3)        Lying is wrong.

(8)        Lying is not wrong.

We saw these claims earlier, in Section 3, when discussing how expressivists are supposed to be able to account for genuine moral disagreement in a way better than ethical subjectivists.  Basically, expressivists account for such disagreement by supposing that a speaker of (3) and a speaker of (8) express incompatible mental states, as is the case with (1) and (7).  But if the incompatible states in the case of (1) and (7) are states of belief that p and belief that not-p (or belief and disbelief), what are the incompatible states in this case?

The non-cognitive mental state expressed by (3) is presumably something like disapproval of lying. So what is the non-cognitive state that is expressed by (8)? On the face of it, this seems like it should be an easy question to answer, but upon reflection, it turns out to be really quite puzzling. Whatever is expressed by (8), it should be something that is independently plausible as the content of such a claim, and it should be something that is somehow incompatible with the state expressed by (3). But what is it?

To see why this is puzzling, consider the following three sentences (adapted from Unwin 1999 and 2001):

(9)        Jones does not think that lying is wrong.

(10)      Jones thinks that not lying is wrong.

(11)      Jones thinks that lying is not wrong.

These three sentences say three importantly different things about Jones. Furthermore, it seems as if the state attributed to Jones in (11) should be the very same state as the one expressed by (8) above. But again, what is that state?  Let us proceed by process of elimination. It cannot be that (11) attributes to Jones a state of approval, that is, approving of lying. Presumably, for Jones to approve of lying would be for Jones to think that lying is right, or good. But that is not what (11) says; it says only that he thinks lying is not wrong. Nor can (11) attribute to Jones a lack of disapproval of lying, since that is what is attributed in (9), and as we’ve already agreed, (9) and (11) tell us different things about Jones. Moreover, (11) also cannot attribute to Jones the state of disapproval of not lying, since that is the state being attributed in (10). But at this point, it is hard to see what mental state is left to be attributed to Jones in (11), and to be the content of (8).

The expressivist does not want to say that (3) and (8) express incompatible beliefs, or states of belief and disbelief, as with (1) and (7), since beliefs are cognitive states, and we know that expressivists are psychological non-cognitivists. If (3) and (8) express beliefs, and we share with Hume the idea that beliefs by themselves are incapable of motivating, then we will apparently not have the resources for explaining the close connection between people sincerely making one of these claims and their being motivated to act accordingly. Nor does the expressivist want to say that (3) and (8) express inconsistent propositions, since that would be to abandon her semantic non-factualism. Propositions are often thought to determine truth conditions, and truth conditions are often thought to be ways the world might be. So to allow that (3) and (8) express propositions would presumably be to allow that there is a way the world might be that would make it true that lying is wrong. Furthermore, accounting for this would involve the expressivist in precisely the sort of moral metaphysical inquiries she seeks to avoid. For these reasons, it is crucial for the expressivist to find a non-cognitive mental state to be the content of (8). It must be something incompatible with the state expressed by (3), and it must be a plausible candidate for the state attributed to Jones in (11). But as we have seen, it is very difficult to articulate just what state it is.

Expressivists must show us that, even after accepting global semantic ideationalism, we are still able to account for all of the same phenomena as those accounted for by traditional propositional approaches to meaning. But here it seems they struggle even with something as simple as negation. Further, until they provide a satisfactory explanation of the contents of negated ethical claims, it will remain unclear whether they really do have a better account of moral disagreement than ethical subjectivists, as has long been claimed.

b. Making Sense of Attitude Ascriptions

Earlier, it was noted that ethical claims are no different from non-ethical claims in being able to articulate the objects of various states of mind. Let us now look closer at why expressivists may have a problem accounting for this particular point of continuity between ethical and non-ethical discourse.

(12)      Frank fears that it is snowing.

(13)      Wanda wonders whether it is snowing.

(14)      Haddie hates that it is snowing.

Claims (12)-(14) ascribe three different attitudes to Frank, Wanda, and Haddie. Clearly, however, these three attitudes have something in common, something that can be represented by the claim from earlier

(1)        It is snowing.

Traditionally, the way that philosophers of mind and language have accounted for this is by saying that (1) expresses the proposition that it is snowing, and that what all three of the attitudes ascribed to Frank, Wanda, and Haddie have in common is that they are all directed at one and the same proposition, that is, they all have the same proposition as their object.

By abandoning traditional propositional semantics, though, expressivists take on the burden of finding some other way of explaining how the contents of expressions like “fears that”, “wonders whether”, and “hates that” are supposed to relate to the content of whatever follows them. If the content of (1) is supposed to be something like the belief that it is snowing, as ideationalists suppose, and (1) is also supposed to be able to articulate the object of Frank’s fear, then the expressivist is apparently committed to thinking that Frank’s fear is actually directed at the belief that it is snowing. But, of course, Frank is not afraid of the belief that it is snowing—he is not afraid to believe that it is snowing—rather, he is afraid that it is snowing.

Things are no less problematic in the ethical case. For consider:

(15)      Frank fears that lying is wrong.

(16)      Wanda wonders whether lying is wrong.

(17)      Haddie hates that lying is wrong.

Here again, it seems right to say that the attitudes ascribed in (15)-(17) all share something in common, something that can be represented by the claim from earlier

(3)        Lying is wrong.

But if it is denied that (3) expresses a proposition, as ethical expressivists and non-cognitivists always have, it becomes unclear how (3) could be used to articulate the object of those attitudes.  Focus upon (15) for a moment. Now, what are the contents of ‘fears that’ and ‘lying is wrong’, such that the latter is the object of the former? We presumably have one answer already, from the expressivist: the content of ‘lying is wrong’ in (15), like the content of (3), is an attitude of disapproval toward lying. However, on the plausible assumption that the content of “fears that” is an attitude of fear toward the content of whatever follows, we apparently get the expressivist saying that (15) ascribes to Frank a fear of disapproval of lying, or a fear of disapproving of lying. But surely that is not what (15) ascribes to Frank. He may fear these other things as well, but (15) says only that he fears that lying is wrong.

The expressivist may try to avoid this puzzle by insisting that “lying is wrong” as it appears in (15) has a content that is different from the content of (3), but this still leaves us wondering what the meanings of claims like (15)-(17) are supposed to be, according to the expressivist’s ideationalist semantics. As Schroeder explains, expressivists “owe an account of the meaning of each and every attitude verb, for example, fears that, wonders whether, and so on; just as much as they owe an account of “not”, “and”, and “if … then”. Very little progress has yet been made on how non-cognitivists [or expressivists] can treat attitude verbs, and the prospects for further progress look dim” (Schroeder 2008d, p.716).

c. Saving the Differences

One might think that a simple way to defeat any non-factualist account of ethical claims is simply to point out that we can coherently embed ethical claims into truth claims. It makes perfect sense, for instance, for someone to say, “It is true that lying is wrong.” Presumably, however, this could only make sense if whatever follows “It is true that” is the sort of thing that can be true. Of course, propositions are among the sorts of things that can be true, in fact, this is often thought to be their distinguishing characteristic. But non-factualists deny that ethical claims express propositions. So how do they account for the fact that the truth-predicate seems to apply just as well to ethical claims as it does to non-ethical claims?

If this were a devastating problem for non-cognitivists, then the non-cognitivist tradition in ethics would not have lasted for very long, since philosophers were well aware of the matter soon after Ayer first published Language, Truth, and Logic in 1936. The thought then—essentially just an application of Ramsey’s (1927) famous redundancy theory of truth—was that, in at least some cases, the truth-predicate does not actually ascribe some metaphysically robust property being true to whatever it is being predicated of. Rather, to add the truth-predicate to a claim is to do nothing more than to simply assert the claim by itself. In claiming that “It is true that lying is wrong,” on this view, a speaker expresses the very same state that is expressed by claiming only that “Lying is wrong,” and nothing more; hence, the “redundancy” of the truth predicate.

In early twenty-first century discourse, theories like Ramsey’s are referred to as deflationary or minimalist theories of truth, since they effectively “deflate” or “minimize” the ontological significance of the truth-predicate. Some ethical expressivists, in part as a way of solving the Continuity Problem, have taken to supplementing their expressivism with deflationism. The basic idea goes something like this: if we accept a deflationary theory of truth across the board, we can apparently say that ethical claims are truth-apt, in fact, every bit as truth-apt as any other sort of claim. This allows the expressivist to avoid simple versions of the objection noted at the beginning of this section.  Interestingly, the deflationism need not stop with the truth-predicate. We might also deflate the notion of a proposition by insisting that a proposition is just whatever is expressed by a truth-apt claim. As long as we allow that ethical claims are truth-apt, in some deflationary sense, we may now be able to say, for instance, that

(3)        Lying is wrong

expresses the proposition that lying is wrong, after all. If this is allowed, then the expressivist may now have the resources for accounting for the compositionality of ethical discourse in basically the same way in which traditional propositional semanticists would do so. The meanings of complex ethical claims are to be understood in terms of the propositions expressed by their parts. Once the notion of a proposition is deflated, we might just as well deflate the notion of belief by saying something to the effect that all it is for one to believe that p is for one to accept a claim that expresses the proposition that p. In these ways, perhaps an expressivist can “earn the right” to talk of truth, propositions, and beliefs, and perhaps also knowledge, in the ethical domain, just as they do in non-ethical domains.

This is the essence of Blackburn’s brand of expressivism, known commonly nowadays as ‘quasi-realism’. As we saw earlier, moral realists are those who believe that moral properties have every bit the ontological status as other, less controversial properties, like roundness and solidity. This allows realists to account for things like truth, propositions, beliefs, and knowledge in the ethical domain in precisely the same way that we ordinarily do in other domains, such as those that include facts about roundness and solidity. By deflating the relevant notions, however, Blackburn and other moral non-realists are nonetheless supposed to be able to say all the things that realists say about moral truth, and the like; hence, “quasi”-realism.

There are at least two problems for ethical expressivists who take this approach to solving the Continuity Problem. The first is simply that deflationism is independently a very controversial view. In his own defense of a deflationary theory of truth, Paul Horwich addresses no fewer than thirty-nine “alleged difficulties” faced by such a theory (Horwich 1998). Granted, he apparently believes that all of these difficulties can be addressed with some degree of satisfaction, but few will deny that deflationary theories of truth represent a departure from the common assumption that truth is a real property of things, and that this property consists in something like a thing’s corresponding with reality. Deflationism may help expressivists avoid the Continuity Problem, but at the cost of then burdening them to defend deflationism against its many problems.

A second and more interesting problem, though, is that taking this deflationary route may, in the end, ruin what was supposed to be so unique about expressivism all along. In other words, there is a sense in which deflationism may too good a response to the Continuity Problem. After all, at the core of ethical expressivism is the belief that there is some significant difference between ethical and non-ethical discourse. Recall again our two basic instances of each:

(1)        It is snowing.

(3)        Lying is wrong.

As we just saw, once deflationism is allowed to run its course, we end up saying remarkably similar things about (1) and (3). Both are truth-apt; both express propositions; both can be the objects of belief; both can be known; and so forth. But now you may be wondering: what, then, is supposed to be the significant difference that sets (3) apart from (1)? Or, another way of putting it: what would be the point of contention between an expressivist and her opponents if both parties agreed to deflate such notions as truth, proposition, and belief? This has sometimes been called the problem of “saving the differences” between ethical and non-ethical discourse.

One response to this problem might be to say that the relevant differences between ethical and non-ethical discourse actually occur at a level below the surface of the two linguistic domains. Recall that we deflated the notion of belief by saying that to believe that p is just to accept a claim that expresses the proposition that p. Using these terms, the expressivist might say that the main difference between (1) and (3) is a matter of what is involved in “accepting” the two claims. Accepting an ethical claim like (3) is something importantly different from accepting a non-ethical claim like (1), and presumably the difference has something to do with the types of mental states involved in doing so.  Whether or not this sort of response will work is the subject of an ongoing debate in early twenty-first century philosophical literature.

5. Recent Trends

While the Continuity Problem remains a lively point, or collection of points, of debate between expressivists and their critics, it is certainly not the only topic with which those involved in the literature are currently occupied. Here we review a few other recent trends in expressivist thought, perhaps the most notable among them being the advent of so-called “hybrid” expressivist theories.

a. Expressivists’ Attitude Problem

There are some who would say that the Continuity Problem just is the Frege-Geach Problem, that is, that the Frege-Geach Problem ought to be understood very broadly, so as to include all of the many issues associated with the apparent logical and semantic continuities between ethical and non-ethical discourse. Even so, ethical expressivism faces other problems as well. Let us now look briefly at an issue that is receiving more and more attention these days—the so-called Moral Attitude Problem for ethical expressivism.

Recall again that expressivists often claim to have a better way of accounting for the nature of moral disagreement than the account on offer from ethical subjectivists. The idea, according to the expressivist, is supposed to be that a moral disagreement is ultimately just a disagreement in non-cognitive attitudes. Rather than expressing propositions about their opposing attitudes—which, we saw earlier, would be perfectly compatible with each other—the two disagreeing parties directly express those opposing non-cognitive attitudes. But then, in our discussion of the puzzle about negation, we saw that the expressivist may actually owe us more than this. Specifically, she owes us an explanation of what, exactly, those opposing attitudes are supposed to be. If Jones claims that lying is wrong, and Smith claims that it is not wrong, then Jones and Smith are engaged in a moral disagreement about lying. The expressivist, presumably, will say that Jones expresses something like disapproval of lying. But then what is the state that is directly expressed by Smith’s claim, such that it is disagrees, or is incompatible, with Jones’ disapproval?

According to the Moral Attitude Problem, the issue actually runs deeper than this, for there are more constraints on the expressivist’s answer than just that the state expressed by Smith be something incompatible with Jones’ disapproval of lying. In fact, Jones’ disapproval of lying may turn out to be no less mysterious than whatever sort of state is supposed to be expressed by Smith. After all, we disapprove of all sorts of things. Suppose that Jones also disapproves of Quentin Tarantino movies, but Smith does not. Presumably, this would not count as a moral disagreement, despite the fact that Jones and Smith are expressing mental states similar to those expressed in their disagreement about lying. So what is it, according to ethical expressivism, that makes the one disagreement, and not the other, a moral disagreement? This is especially puzzling given that expressivists often clarify their view by saying that moral disagreements are more like aesthetic disagreements, like a disagreement over Tarantino films; than they are like disagreements over facts, such as whether or not it is snowing.

So the Moral Attitude Problem, basically, is the problem of specifying the exact type, or types, of attitude expressed by ethical claims, such that someone expressing the relevant state counts as making an ethical claim—as opposed to an aesthetic claim, or something else entirely. Judith Thomson raises something like the Moral Attitude Problem when she writes,

The [ethical expressivist] needs to avail himself of a special kind of approval and disapproval: these have to be moral approval and moral disapproval.  For presumably he does not wish to say that believing Alice ought to do a thing is having toward her doing it the same attitude of approval that I have toward the sound of her splendid new violin. (Thomson 1996, p.110)

And several years later, in a paper entitled “Some Not-Much-Discussed Problems for Non-Cognitivism in Ethics,” Michael Smith raises the same problem:

[Ethical expressivists] insist that it is analytic that when people sincerely make normative claims they thereby express desires or aversions.  But which desires and aversions … , and what special feature do they possess that makes them especially suitable for expression in a normative claim? (Smith 2001, p.107)

But it is only very recently that expressivists and their opponents have begun to give the Moral Attitude Problem the attention that it deserves (see Merli 2008; Kauppinen 2010; Köhler 2013; Miller 2013, pp.39-47, pp.81-87; and Björnsson and McPherson 2014)

What can the expressivist say in response? For starters, expressivists can, and should, point out that the Moral Attitude Problem is not unique to their view. Indeed, those who think that ethical claims express cognitive states, like beliefs—namely, ethical cognitivists—face a very similar challenge: Jones believes both that lying is wrong and that Quentin Tarantino movies are bad, but only one of these counts as a moral belief; what is it, exactly, that distinguishes the moral from the non-moral belief? Cognitivists will say that the one belief has a moral proposition as its content, whereas the other belief does not. But that just pushes the question back a step: what, now, is it that distinguishes the moral from the non-moral proposition? Whether it be a matter of spelling out the difference between moral and non-moral beliefs, or that between moral and non-moral propositions, cognitivists are no less burdened to give an account of the nature of moral thinking than are ethical expressivists.

In fact, Köhler argues that expressivists can actually take what are essentially the same routes in response to the Moral Attitude Problem as those taken by cognitivists. Cognitivists, he thinks, have just two options: they can either (a) characterize the nature of moral thinking by reference to some realm of sui generis moral facts which, when they are the objects of beliefs, make those beliefs moral beliefs, or else (b) do the same, but without positing a realm of sui generis moral facts, and instead identifying moral facts with some set of non-moral facts. Similarly, it seems expressivists have two options: they can either (a) say that “the moral attitude” is some sui generis state of mind, or else (b) insist that “the moral attitude” can be analyzed in terms of non-cognitive mental states with which we are already familiar, like desires and aversions, approval and disapproval, and so forth.

The second of these options for expressivists is certainly the more popular of the two. But according to Köhler, if expressivists are to be successful in taking this approach, they ought to conceive of the identity between “the moral attitude” and other, more familiar non-cognitive states in much the same way that naturalistic moral realists conceive of the identity between moral and non-moral facts—that is, either by insisting that the identity is synthetic a posteriori, as the so-called “Cornell realists” do with moral and non-moral facts, or by insisting that the identity is conceptual, but non-obvious, an approach to conceptual analysis proposed by David Lewis, and recently taken up by a few philosophers from Canberra. Otherwise, if an expressivist is comfortable allowing for a sui generis non-cognitive mental state to hold the place of “the moral attitude,” she should get to work explaining what this state is like. Indeed, Köhler argues that this can be done without violating expressivism’s long-standing commitment to metaphysical naturalism (see Köhler 2013, pp.495-507).

b. Hybrid Theories

Perhaps the most exciting of recent trends in the expressivism literature is the advent of so-called “hybrid” expressivist theories. The idea behind hybrid theories, very basically, is that we might be able to secure all of the advantages of both expressivism and cognitivism by allowing that ethical claims express both non-cognitive and cognitive mental states. Why call them hybrid expressivist views, then, and not hybrid cognitivist views? Recall that the two central theses of ethical expressivism are psychological non-cognitivism—the thesis that ethical claims express mental states that are characteristically non-cognitive—and semantic ideationalism—the thesis that the meanings of ethical claims are to be understood in terms of the mental states that they express. Since neither of these theses state that ethical claims express only non-cognitive states, the hybrid theorist can affirm both of them whole-heartedly. For that reason, hybrid theories are generally considered to be forms of expressivism.

The idea that a single claim might express two distinct mental states is not a new one. Philosophers of language have long thought, for instance, that slurs and pejoratives are capable of doing this. Consider the term “yankee” as used by people living in the American South. In most cases, among Southerners, to call someone a “yankee” is to express a certain sort of negative attitude toward the person. But importantly, the term “yankee” cannot apply to just anyone, rather, it applies only to people who are from the North. Acordingly, when native Southerner Roy says, “Did you hear?  Molly’s dating a yankee!” he expresses both (a) a belief that Molly’s partner is from the North, and (b) a negative attitude toward Molly’s partner. It seems we need to suppose that Roy has and expresses both of these states—one cognitive, the other non-cognitive—in order to make adequate sense of the meaning of his claim. In much the same way, hybrid theorists in metaethics suggest that ethical claims can express both beliefs and attitudes. Indeed, these philosophers often model their theories on an analogy to the nature of slurs and pejoratives (see Hay 2013).

Even within the expressivist tradition, the language of hybridity may be new, but the basic idea is not. Recall from earlier that Hare believed ethical claims have two sorts of meaning: descriptive meaning and prescriptive meaning. To claim that something is “good,” he thinks, is to both (a) say or imply that it has some context-specific set of non-moral properties; this is the claim’s descriptive meaning, and (b) commend the thing in virtue of these properties; this is the claim’s prescriptive meaning. This is not far off from a hybrid view according to which “good”-claims express both (a) a belief that something has some property or properties, and (b) a positive non-cognitive attitude toward the thing. Hare was apparently ahead of his time in this respect. The hybrid movement as it is now known is less than a decade old.

One of the earliest notable hybrid views is Ridge’s “ecumenical expressivism” (see Ridge 2006 and 2007). In its initial form, ecumenical expressivism is the view that ethical claims express two closely related mental states—one a belief, and the other a non-cognitive state like approval or disapproval. Furthermore, as an instance of semantic ideationalism, ecumenical expressivism adds that the literal meanings, or semantic contents, of ethical claims are to be understood solely in terms of these mental states. So, for example, the claim

(3)        Lying is wrong

expresses something like these two states: (a) disapproval of things that have a certain property F, and (b) a belief that lying has property F. Notably, the view allows for a kind of subjectivity to moral judgment, since the nature of property F will differ from person to person. A utilitarian, for instance, might disapprove of behavior that fails to maximize utility; a Kantian might instead disapprove of behavior that disrespects people’s autonomy; and so on and so forth. Furthermore, Ridge’s view is supposed to be able to solve the Frege-Geach Problem by conceiving of logical inference and validity in terms of the relationships that obtain among beliefs.

(4)        If lying is wrong, then getting your little brother to lie is wrong.

According to ecumenical expressivism, complex ethical claims like (4) also express two states: (a) disapproval of things that have a certain property F, and (b) the complex belief that if lying has property F, then getting one’s little brother to lie has property F as well. Coupled with an account of logical validity understood in terms of consistency of beliefs, this looks like a promising way to satisfy Geach’s two challenges. (Ridge has since updated his view so that it is no longer a semantic theory, but rather a meta-semantic theory. Thus, rather than attempting to assign literal meanings to ethical claims, Ridge means only to explain that in virtue of which ethical claims have the meanings that they do. See Ridge 2014.)

The implicature-style views defended by Copp and Finlay also fall within the hybrid camp (Copp 2001, 2009; Finlay 2004, 2005). Coined by philosopher H. Paul Grice, the term “implicature” refers to a semantic phenomenon in which a speaker means or implies one thing, while saying something else. A popular example is that of the professor who writes, “Alex has good handwriting,” in a letter of recommendation. What the professor says is that Alex has good handwriting, but what the professor means or implies is that Alex is not an especially good student. So the claim “Alex has good handwriting” has both a literal content, that Alex has good handwriting, and an implicated content, that Alex is not an especially good student.

In the same way, Copp and Finlay suggest that ethical claims have both literal and implicated contents. Once again:

(3)        Lying is wrong

According to these implicature-style views, someone who sincerely utters (3) thereby communicates two things. First, she either expresses a belief, or asserts a proposition, to the effect that lying is wrong—this is the claim’s literal content. Second, she implies that she has some sort of non-cognitive attitude toward lying—this is the claim’s implicated content. It is in this way that implicature-style views are supposed to capture the virtues of both cognitivism and expressivism. Where Copp and Finlay disagree is over the matter of what it is in virtue of which the non-cognitive attitude is implicated. According to Copp, it is a matter of linguistic conventions that govern ethical discourse; whereas Finlay thinks it is a matter of the dynamics of ethical conversation. So Copp’s view is an instance of conventional implicature, while Finlay’s is an instance of conversational implicature.

There may be yet another way to “go hybrid” with one’s expressivism. Rather than hybridizing the mental state(s) expressed by ethical claims, one might instead hybridize the very notion of expression itself. This is the route taken by defenders of a view known as ‘ethical neo-expressivism’ (Bar-On and Chrisman 2009; Bar-On, Chrisman, and Sias 2014). Ethical neo-expressivism rests upon two very important distinctions. The first is a distinction between two different kinds of expression. When we say that agents express their mental states and that sentences express propositions, we refer not just to two different instances of expression, but more importantly, to two different kinds expression, which are often conflated by expressivists.  To see how the two kinds of expression come apart, consider:

(18)      It is so great to see you!

(19)      I am so glad to see you!

Intuitively, these two sentences have different semantic contents. Setting aside complicated issues related to indexicality, sentence (18) expresses the proposition that it is so great to see you (the addressee), and sentence (19) expresses the proposition that I (the speaker) am so glad to see you (the addressee). However, these two different sentences might nonetheless function as vehicles for expressing the same mental state, that is, I might express my gladness or joy at seeing a friend by uttering either of them. Indeed, I might also do so by hugging my friend, or even just by smiling. Importantly, the neo-expressivist urges, it is not the speaker who expresses this or that proposition, but the sentences. People cannot express propositions, but sentences can, in virtue of being conventional representations of them. However, it is not the sentences that express gladness or joy, but the speaker. Sentences cannot express mental states; they are just strings of words. But people can certainly express their mental states by performing various acts, some of which involve the utterance of sentences. Call the relation between sentences and propositions semantic-expression, or s-expression; and call the relation between agents and their mental states action-expression, or a-expression.

According to neo-expressivists, most ethical expressivists, including most hybrid theorists, conflate these two senses of expression because they fail to adequately recognize a second distinction. Notice that terms like “claim”, “judgment”, and “statement” are ambiguous: they might refer either to an act or to the product of that act. So the term “ethical claim” might refer either to the act of making an ethical claim, or to the product of this act—which, presumably, is a sentence tokened either in thought or in speech. This distinction between ethical claims understood as acts and ethical claims understood as products maps nicely onto the earlier distinction between a- and s-expression. Understood as acts, ethical claims are different from non-ethical claims in that, when making an ethical claim, a speaker a-expresses some non-cognitive attitude. In this way, neo-expressivists can apparently affirm psychological non-cognitivism, and may also have the resources for “saving the differences” between ethical and non-ethical discourse. On the other hand, understood as products—that is, sentences containing ethical terms—ethical claims are just like non-ethical claims in s-expressing propositions, and not necessarily in the deflationary sense of proposition noted above. By allowing that ethical claims express propositions, the neo-expressivist may have all she needs in order to avoid the Continuity Problem.

Now, according to some, semantic ideationalism is essential to expressivism. Gibbard, for instance, writes, “The term ‘expressivism’ I mean to cover any account of meanings that follow this indirect path: to explain the meaning of a term, explain what states of mind the term can be used to express” (2003, p.7). However, ethical neo-expressivism, as we have just seen, rejects semantic ideationalism in favor of the more traditional propositional approach to meaning. In light of this, one might legitimately wonder whether neo-expressivism ought to count as an expressivist view. But as Bar-On, Chrisman, and Sias (2014) argue, neo-expressivism is perfectly capable of accommodating both of the main motivations of non-cognitivism and expressivism described in Sections 1 and 3—that is, avoiding a commitment to “spooky,” irreducibly normative properties, and accounting for the close connection between sincere ethical claims and motivation.  Besides, as we saw earlier, it looks like the expressivist’s commitment to semantic ideationalism is what got her into trouble with the Continuity Problem in the first place. So even if neo-expressivism represents something of a departure from mainstream expressivist thought, it may nonetheless be a departure worth considering.

c. Recent Work in Empirical Moral Psychology

Expressivists have long recognized that it is possible to make an ethical claim without being in whatever is supposed to be the corresponding non-cognitive mental state. It is possible, for instance, to utter

(3)        Lying is wrong

without, at the same time, disapproving of lying. Maybe the speaker is just reciting a line from a play; or maybe the speaker suffers from a psychological disorder that renders him incapable of ever being in the relevant non-cognitive state, and he is just repeating something that he has heard others say. These are surely possibilities, and expressivists have at times had different things to say about them, and other cases like them. Either way, though, expressivists generally assume that ethical claims are nonetheless tied to non-cognitive states in a way that justifies us in thinking that a speaker of an ethical claim, if she is being sincere, ought to be motivated to act accordingly. This is one of the two main motivations that attract people to theories in the expressivist tradition.

The assumption that sincere ethical claims in ordinary cases are accompanied by non-cognitive states is presumably one that has empirical implications.  If true, for instance, one might expect to find activity in regions of the brain associated with such states as people make ethical claims sincerely. Indeed, this is precisely what researchers in empirical moral psychology have found throughout various studies conducted over the past few decades. From brain scans to behavioral experiments, tests of skin conductance to moral judgment surveys given in disgusting environments, study after study seems to confirm a view that is sometimes called “psychological sentimentalism”—that is, the view that people are prompted to make the ethical claims that they make primarily by their emotional responses to things.

Now, to be sure, the link posited by psychological sentimentalism is a causal one—our emotions cause us to make certain ethical claims—and that is importantly different from the conceptual link that expressivists generally assume exists between non-cognitive states and ethical claims. But expressivists may nonetheless benefit from exploring how recent work in empirical moral psychology can be used to support parts of their view—for example, how it is that the conceptual link is supposed to have come about. If nothing else, expressivists may find significant empirical support for the view, shared by everyone in the tradition since Ayer, that ethical claims are expressions of characteristically non-cognitive states of mind.

6. References and Further Reading

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  • Moore, G. E. (1903). Principia Ethica. New York: Cambridge University Press.
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  • Ridge, M. (2014). Impassioned Belief. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ridge, M. and G. Fletcher, eds. (2014). Having It Both Ways: Hybrid Theories and Modern Metaethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Schroeder, M. (2008a). Being For: Evaluating the Semantic Program of Expressivism. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
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  • Schroeder, M. (2008c). “How Expressivists Can and Should Solve Their Problem with Negation.” Noûs 42(4): 573-599.
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Author Information

James Sias
Dickinson College
U. S. A.

Kwasi Wiredu (1931— )

Kwasi Wiredu is a philosopher from Ghana, who has for decades been involved with a project he terms “conceptual decolonization” in contemporary African systems of thought.  By conceptual decolonization, Wiredu advocates a re-examination of current African epistemic formations in order to accomplish two aims.  First, he wishes to subvert unsavory aspects of tribal culture embedded in modern African thought so as to make that thought more viable.  Second, he intends to dislodge unnecessary Western epistemologies that are to be found in African philosophical practices.

In previously colonized regions of the world, decolonization remains a topical issue both at the highest theoretical levels and also at the basic level of everyday existence. After African countries attained political liberation, decolonization became an immediate and overwhelming preoccupation.  A broad spectrum of academic disciplines took up the conceptual challenges of decolonization in a variety of ways.  The disciplines of anthropology, history, political science, literature, and philosophy all grappled with the practical and academic conundrums of decolonization.

A central purpose in this article is to examine the contributions and limitations of African philosophy in relation to the history of the debate on decolonization.  In this light, it sometimes appears that African philosophy has been quite limited in defining the horizons of the debate when compared with the achievements of academic specialties such as literature and cultural studies. Thus, decolonization has been rightly conceived as a vast, global, and trans-disciplinary enterprise.

This analysis involves an examination of both the limitations and immense possibilities of Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization.  First, the article offers a close reading of the theory itself and then locates it within the broader movement of modern African thought.  In several instances, Wiredu’s theory has proved seminal to the advancement of contemporary African philosophical practices.  It is also necessary to be aware of current imperatives of globalization, nationality, and territoriality and how they affect the agency of a theory such as ideological/conceptual decolonization.  Indeed, the notion of decolonization is far more complex than is often assumed.  Consequently, the epistemological resources by which it can be apprehended as a concept, ideology, or process are multiple and diverse.  Lastly, this article, as a whole, represents a reflection on the diversity of the dimensions of decolonization.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Early Beginnings
  3. Decolonization as Epistemological Practice
  4. Tradition, Modernity and the Challenges of Development
  5. An African Reading of Karl Marx
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Kwasi Wiredu is one of Africa’s foremost philosophers, and he has done a great deal to establish the discipline of philosophy, in its contemporary shape, as a credible area of intellection in most parts of the African continent and beyond.  In order to appreciate the conceptual and historical contexts of his work, it is necessary to possess some familiarity with relevant discourses in African studies and history, anthropology, literature and postcolonial theory, particularly those advanced by Edward W. Said, Gayatri Spivak, Homi Bhabha, Abiola Irele and Biodun Jeyifo.  Wiredu’s contribution to the making of modern African thought provides an interesting insight into the processes involved in the formation of postcolonial disciplines and discourses, and it can also be conceived as a counter-articulation to the hegemonic discourses of imperial domination.

 Wiredu, for many decades, was involved with a project he termed conceptual decolonization in contemporary African systems of thought. This term entailed, for Wiredu, a re-examination of current African epistemic foundations in order to accomplish two main objectives.  First, he intended to undermine counter-productive facets of tribal cultures embedded in modern African, thought so as to make this body of thought both more sustainable and more rational.  Second, he intended to deconstruct the unnecessary Western epistemologies which may be found in African philosophical practices.

A broad spectrum of academic disciplines took up the conceptual challenges of decolonization in a variety of ways. In particular, the disciplines of anthropology, history, political science, literature and philosophy all grappled with the practical and academic challenges inherent to decolonization.

It is usually profitable to examine the contributions and limitations of African philosophers comparatively (along with other African thinkers who are not professional philosophers) in relation to the history of the debate on decolonization.  In addition to the scholars noted above, the discourse of decolonialization has benefitted from many valuable contributions made by intellectuals such as Frantz Fanon, Leopold Sedar Senghor, Cheikh Anta Diop, and Ngugi wa Thiongo.  In this light, it would appear that African philosophy has been, at certain moments, limited in defining the horizons of the debate when compared with the achievements of academic specialties such as literature, postcolonial theory and cultural studies. Thus, decolonization, as Ngugi wa Thiongo, the Kenyan cultural theorist and novelist, notes, must be conceived as a broad, transcontinental, and multidisciplinary venture.

Within the Anglophone contingent of African philosophy, the analytic tradition of British philosophy continues to be dominant.  This discursive hegemony had led an evident degree of parochialism.  This in turn has led to the neglect of many other important intellectual traditions.  For instance, within this Anglophonic sphere, there is not always a systematic interrogation of the limits, excesses and uses of colonialist anthropology in formulating the problematic of identity.  In this regard, the problematic of identity does not only refer to the question of personal agency but more broadly, the challenges of discursive identity.  This shortcoming is not as evident in Francophone traditions of African philosophy, which usually highlight the foundational discursive interactions between anthropology and modern African thought.  Thus, in this instance, there is an opening to other discursive formations necessary for the nurturing a vibrant philosophical practice.  Also, within Anglophone African philosophy, a stringent critique of imperialism and contemporary globalization does not always figure is not always significantly in the substance of the discourse, thereby further underlining the drawbacks of parochialism.  As such, it is necessary for critiques of Wiredu’s corpus to move beyond its ostensible frame to include critiques and discussions of traditions of philosophical practice outside the Anglophone divide of modern African thought (Osha, 2005).  Accordingly, such critiques ought not merely be a celebration of post-structuralist discourses to the detriment of African intellectual traditions.  Instead, they should be, among other things, an exploration of the discursive intimacies between the Anglophone and Francophone traditions of African philosophy.  In addition, an interrogation of other borders of philosophy is required to observe the gains that might accrue to the Anglophone movement of contemporary African philosophy, which, in many ways, has reached a discursive dead-end due to its inability to surmount the intractable problematic of identity, and its endless preoccupation with the question of its origins. These are the sort of interrogations that readings of Wiredu’s work necessitate. Furthermore, a study of Wiredu’s corpus (Osha, 2005) identifies—if only obliquely—the necessity to re-assess the importance of other discourses such as colonialist anthropology and various philosophies of black subjectivity in the formation of the modern African subject.  These are some of the central concerns which appear in Kwasi Wiredu and Beyond: The Text, Writing and Thought in Africa (2005).

2. Early Beginnings

Kwasi Wiredu was born in 1931 in Ghana and had his first exposure to philosophy quite early in life.  He read his first couple of books of philosophy in school around 1947 in Kumasi, the capital of Ashanti.  These books were Bernard Bosanquet’s The Essentials of Logic and C.E.M. Joad’s Teach Yourself Philosophy.  Logic, as a branch of philosophy attracted Wiredu because of its affinities to grammar, which he enjoyed.  He was also fond of practical psychology during the formative years of his life.  In 1950, whilst vacationing with his aunt in Accra, the capital of Ghana, he came across another philosophical text which influenced him tremendously.  The text was The Last Days of Socrates which had the following four dialogues by Plato: The Apology, Euthyphro, Meno and Crito. These dialogues were to influence, in a significant way, the final chapter of his first groundbreaking philosophical text, Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) which is also dialogic in structure.

He was admitted into the University of Ghana, Legon in 1952, to read philosophy, but before attending he started to study the thought of John Dewey on his own. However, mention must be made of the fact that C. E. M. Joad’s philosophy had a particularly powerful effect on him. Indeed, he employed the name J. E. Joad as his pen-name for a series of political articles he wrote for a national newspaper, The Ashanti Sentinel between 1950 and1951.  At the University of Ghana, he was instructed mainly in Western philosophy and he came to find out about African traditions of thought more or less through his own individual efforts.  He was later to admit that the character of his undergraduate education was to leave his mind a virtual tabula rasa, as far as African philosophy was concerned.  In other words, he had to develop and maintain his interests in African philosophy on his own. One of the first texts of African philosophy that he read was J. B. Danquah’s Akan Doctrine of God: A Fragment of Gold Coast Ethics and Religion.  Undoubtedly, his best friend William Abraham, who went a year before him to Oxford University, must have also influenced the direction of his philosophical research towards African thought.  A passage from an interview explains the issue of his institutional relation to African philosophy:

Prior to 1985, when I was in Africa, I devoted most of my time in almost equal proportions to research in African philosophy and in other areas of philosophy, such as the philosophy of logic, in which not much has, or is generally known to have, been done in African philosophy.  I did not have always to be teaching African philosophy or giving public lectures in African philosophy. There were others who were also competent to teach the subject and give talks in our Department of Philosophy.  But since I came to the United States, I have often been called upon to teach or talk about African philosophy.  I have therefore spent much more time than before researching in that area. This does not mean that I have altogether ignored my earlier interests, for indeed, I continue to teach subjects like (Western) logic and epistemology (Wiredu in Oladiop 2002: 332).

Wiredu began publishing relatively late, but has been exceedingly prolific ever since he started. During the early to mid 1970s, he often published as many as six major papers per year on topics ranging from logic, to epistemology, to African systems of thought, in reputable international journals.  His first major book, Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) is truly remarkable for its eclectic range of interests.  Paulin Hountondji, Wiredu’s great contemporary from the Republic of Benin, for many years had to deal with charges that his philosophically impressive corpus lacked ideological content and therefore merit from critics such as Olabiyi Yai (1977).  Hountondji (1983; 2002) in those times of extreme ideologizing, never avoided the required measure of socialist posturing.  Wiredu, on the other hand, not only avoided the lure of socialism but went on to denounce it as an unfit ideology.  Within the context of the socio-political moment of that era, it seemed a reactionary—even injurious—posture to adopt.  Nonetheless, he had not only laid the foundations of his project of conceptual decolonization at the theoretical level but had also begun to explore its various practical implications by his analyses of concepts such as “truth,” and also by his focused critique of some of the more counter-productive impacts of both colonialism and traditional culture.

By conceptual decolonization, Wiredu advocates a re-examination of current African epistemic formations in order to accomplish two objectives.  First, he wishes to subvert unsavoury aspects of indigenous traditions embedded in modern African thought so as to make it more viable.  Second, he intends to undermine the unhelpful Western epistemologies to be found in African philosophical traditions. On this important formulation of his he states:

By this I mean the purging of African philosophical thinking of all uncritical assimilation of Western ways of thinking. That, of course, would be only part of the battle won. The other desiderata are the careful study of our own traditional philosophies and the synthesising of any insights obtained from that source with any other insights that might be gained from the intellectual resources of the modern world.  In my opinion, it is only by such a reflective integration of the traditional and the modern that contemporary African philosophers can contribute to the flourishing of our peoples and, ultimately, all other peoples. (Oladipo, 2002: 328)

In spite of his invaluable contributions to modern African thought, it can be argued that Wiredu’s schema falls short as a feasible long term epistemic project.  Due to the hybridity of the postcolonial condition, projects seeking to retrieve the precolonial heritage are bound to be marred at several levels.  It would be an error for Wiredu or advocates of his project of conceptual decolonization to attempt to universalize his theory since, as Ngugi wa Thiongo argues, decolonization is a vast, global enterprise.  Rather, it is safer to read Wiredu’s project as a way of articulating theoretical presence for the de-agentialized and deterritorialized contemporary African subject.  In many ways, his project resembles those of Ngugi wa Thiongo and Cheikh Anta Diop.  Ngugi wa Thiongo advocates cultural and linguistic decolonization on a global scale and his theory has undergone very little transformation since its formulation in the 1960s.  Diop advances a similar set of ideas to Wiredu on the subject of vibrant modern African identities. Wiredu’s project is linked in conceptual terms to the broader project of political decolonization as advanced by liberationist African leaders such as Julius Nyerere, Jomo Kenyatta, Kwame Nkrumah, and Nnamdi Azikiwe.  But what distinguishes the particular complexion of his theory is its links with the Anglo-Saxon analytic tradition. This dimension is important in differentiating his project from those of his equally illustrious contemporaries such as V. Y. Mudimbe and Paulin Hountondji.  In fact, it can be argued that Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization has more similarities with Ngugi wa Thiongo’s ideas regarding African cultural and linguistic agency than Mudimbe’s archeological excavations of African traces in Western historical and anthropological texts.

3. Decolonization as Epistemological Practice

In all previously colonized regions of the world, decolonization remains a topic of considerable academic interest.  Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization is essentially what defines his attitudes and gestures towards the content of contemporary African thought.  Also it is an insight that is inflected by years of immersion into British analytic philosophy.  Wiredu began his reflections of the nature, legitimate aims, and possible orientations in contemporary African thought not as a result of any particular awareness of the trauma or violence of colonialism or imperialism but by a confrontation with the dilemma of modernity by the reflective (post)colonial African consciousness.  This dialectic origin can be contrasted with those of his contemporaries such as Paulin Hountondji and V. Y. Mudimbe.

Despite criticisms regarding some aspects of his work, in terms of founding a tradition for the practice of modern African philosophy, Wiredu’s contributions have been pivotal. He has also been very consistent in his output and the quality of his reflections regardless of some of their more obvious limitations.

As noted earlier, Wiredu was trained in a particular tradition of Western philosophy: the analytic tradition.  This fact is reflected in his corpus.  A major charge held against him is that his contributions could be made even richer if he had grappled with other relevant discourses: postcolonial theory, African feminisms, contemporary Afrocentric discourses and the global dimensions of projects and discourses of decolonization.

Kwasi Wiredu’s interests and philosophical importance are certainly not limited to conceptual decolonization alone.  He has offered some useful insights on Marxism, mysticism, metaphysics, and the general nature of the philosophical enterprise itself. Although his latter text, Cultural Universals and Particulars has a more Africa-centred orientation, his first book, Philosophy and an African Culture presents a wider range of discursive interests: a vigorous critique of Marxism, reflections on the phenomenon of ideology, analyses of truth and the philosophy of language, among other preoccupations. It is interesting to see how Wiredu weaves together these different preoccupations and also to observe how some of them have endured while others have not.

The volume Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy is an apt summation of Wiredu’s philosophical interests with a decidedly African problematic while his landmark philosophical work, Philosophy and an African Culture, published first in 1980, should serve as a fertile source for more detailed elucidation.

In the second essay of Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy entitled “The Need for Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy”, Wiredu writes that “with an even greater sense of urgency the intervening decade does not seem to have brought any indications of a widespread realization of the need for conceptual decolonisation in African philosophy” (Wiredu, 1995: 23).  The intention at this juncture is to examine some of the ways in which Wiredu has been involved in the daunting task of conceptual decolonization.  Decolonization itself is a problematic exercise because it necessitates the jettisoning of certain conceptual attitudes that inform one’s worldviews.  Secondly, it usually entails an attempt at the retrieval of a more or less fragmented historical heritage.  Decolonization in Fanon’s conception entails this necessity for all colonized peoples and, in addition, it is “a programme of complete disorder” (Fanon, 1963:20).  This understanding is purely political and has therefore, a practical import.  This is not to say that Fanon had no plan for the project of decolonization in the intellectual sphere.  Also associated with this project as it was then conceived was a struggle for the mental liberation of the colonized African peoples.  It was indeed a program of violence in more senses than one.

However, with Wiredu, there isn’t an outright endorsement of violence, as decolonization in this instance amounts to conceptual subversion.  As a logical consequence, it is necessary to stress the difference between Fanon’s conception of decolonization and Wiredu’s.  Fanon is sometimes regarded as belonging to the same philosophical persuasion that harbours figures like Nkrumah, Senghor, Nyerere and Sekou Toure, “the philosopher-kings of early post-independence Africa” (Wiredu,1995:14), as Wiredu calls them.  This is so because they had to live out the various dramas of existence and the struggles for self and collective identity at more or less the same colonial/postcolonial moment.  Those “spiritual uncles” of professional African philosophers were engaged, as Wiredu states, in a strictly political struggle, and whatever philosophical insight they possessed was put at the disposal of this struggle, instead of a merely theoretical endeavour.  Obviously, Fanon was the most astute theoretician of decolonization of the lot.  In addition, for Fanon and the so-called philosopher-kings, decolonization was invested with a pan-African mandate and political appeal.  This crucial difference should be noted alongside what shall soon be demonstrated to be the Wiredu conception of decolonization.  Africans, generally, will have to continue to ponder the entire issue of decolonization as long as unsolved questions of identity remain and the challenges of collective development linger.  This type of challenge was foreseen by Fanon.

The end of colonialism in Africa and other Third World countries did not entail the end of imperialism and the dominance of the metropolitan countries.  Instead, the dynamics of dominance assumed a more complex, if subtle, form.  African economic systems floundered alongside African political institutions, and, as a result, various crises have compounded the seemingly perennial issue of underdevelopment.

A significant portion of post-colonial theory involves the entry of Third World scholars into the Western archive, as it were, with the intention of dislodging the erroneous epistemological assumptions and structures regarding their peoples.  This, arguably, is another variant of decolonization.  Wiredu partakes of this type of activity, but sometimes he carries the program even further.  Accordingly, he affirms:

Until Africa can have a lingua franca, we will have to communicate suitable parts of our work in our multifarious vernaculars, and in other forms of popular discourse, while using the metropolitan languages for international communication. (Wiredu, 1995:20)

This conviction has been a guiding principle with Wiredu for several years.  In fact, it is not merely a conviction; there are several instances within the broad spectrum of his philosophical corpus where he tries to put it into practice.  Two of such attempts are his essays “The Concept of Truth in the Akan Language” and “The Akan Concept of Mind.”  In the first of these articles, Wiredu states “there is no one word in Akan for truth” (Wiredu, 1985:46).  Similarly, he writes, “another linguistic contrast between Akan and English is that there is no word “fact” (Ibid.).  It is necessary to cite the central thesis of the essay; Wiredu writes that he wants “to make a metadoctrinal point which reflection on the African language enables us to see, which is that a theory of truth is not of any real universal significance unless it offers some account of the notion of being so” (Ibid.).

Wiredu’s argument here, needs to be firmer.  In many respects, he is only comparing component parts of the English language with the Akan language and not always with a view to drawing out “any real universal significance” as he says.  The entire approach seems to be irrevocably restrictive.  This is the distinction that lies between an oral culture and a textual one.  Most African intellectuals usually gloss over this difference, even though they may acknowledge it.  The difference is indeed very significant, because of the numerous imponderables that come into play.  Abiola Irele has been able to demonstrate the tremendous significance of orality in the constitution of modern African forms of literary expression.

However, Wiredu is more convincing in his essay “Democracy and Consensus in African Traditional Politics: A Plea for a Non-Party Polity”.  In this essay, Wiredu argues that the:

Ashanti system was a consensual democracy. It was a democracy because government was by the consent, and subject to the control, of the people as expressed through the representatives. It was consensual because, at least, as a rule, that consent was negotiated on the principle of consensus. (By contrast, the majoritarian system might be said to be, in principle, based on consent without consensus.) (Ibid. pp58-59)

When Wiredu broaches the issue of politics and its present and future contexts in postcolonial Africa, then we are compelled to visit a whole range of debates and discourses especially in the social sciences in Africa.  These arearguably more directly concerned with questions pertaining to governance, democracy, and the challenges of contemporary globalization.

Another essay by Wiredu, entitled “The Akan Concept of Mind” is also an attempt of conceptual recontextualization.  Wiredu begins by stating that he is restricting himself to a study of the Akans of Ghana in order “to keep the discussion within reasonable anthropological bounds” (Wiredu, 1983:113).  His objective is a modest but nevertheless important one, since it fits quite well with his entire philosophical project which, as noted, is concerned with ironing out philosophical issues “on independent grounds” and possibly in one’s own language and the metropolitan language bequeathed by the colonial heritage.

It is therefore appropriate to proceed gradually, traversing the problematic interfaces between various languages in search of satisfactory structures of meaning.  The immediate effect is a radical diminishing of the entire concept of African philosophy, a term which under these circumstances would become even more problematic.  The consequence of Wiredu’s position is that to arrive at the essence of African philosophy, it would be necessary to dismantle its monolithic structure to make it more context-bound.  First, Africa as a spatial entity would require further re-drawing of its often problematic geography.  Second, a new thematics to mediate between the general and the particular would have to be found.  Third, the critique of unanimism and ethnophilosophy would be driven into more contested terrains.  These are some of the likely challenges posed by Wiredu’s approach.

Furthermore, in dealing with the traditional Akan conceptual system, or any other, for that matter, it should be borne in mind that what is in contention is “a folk philosophy, a body of originally unwritten ideas preserved in the oral traditions, customs and usages of a people” (Ibid.).

It would be appropriate to examine more closely his article “The Akan Concept of Mind”.  Here, Wiredu enumerates the ways in which the English conception of mind differs markedly from that of the Akan, due in a large part to certain fundamental linguistic dissimilarities.  He also makes the point that “the Akans most certainly do not regard mind as one of the entities that go to constitute a person” (Ibid. 121).  It is significant to note this, but at the same time, it is difficult to imagine the ultimate viability of this approach.  Indeed after reformulating traditional Western philosophical problems to suit African conditions, it remains to be seen how African epistemological claims can be substantiated using the natural and logical procedures available to African systems of thought.  As such, it is possible to argue that this conceptual manoeuvre would eventually degenerate into a dead-end of epistemic nativism.  These are the kinds of issues raised by Wiredu’s project.

As such, inherent in the thrust for complete decolonization is the presence of colonial violence itself.  In addition, there is essentially a latent desire for epistemic violence, as well as difficulties concerning the negotiation of linguistic divides. In the following quotation, for example, Wiredu attempts to demonstrate the significance of some of those differences:

By comparison with the conflation of concepts of mind and soul prevalent in Western philosophy, the Akan separation of the “Okra” from “adwene” suggests a more analytical awareness of the sanctification of human personality. (Ibid.128)

It is necessary to substantiate more rigorously claims such as this because we may also be committing an error in establishing certain troublesome linguistic or philosophical correspondences between two disparate cultures and traditions.

Another crucial, if distressing, feature of decolonization as advanced by Wiredu is that it always has to measure itself up with the colonizing Other, that is, it finds it almost impossible to create its own image so to speak by the employment of autochthonous strategies.  This is not to assert that decolonization always has to avail itself of indigenous procedures, but the very concept of decolonization is in fact concerned with breaking away from imperial structures of dominance in order to express a will to self-identity or presence.  To be sure, the Other is always present, defacing all claims to full presence of the decolonizing subject.  This is a contradictory but inevitable trope within the postcolonial condition.  The Other is always there to present the criteria by which self-identity is adjudged either favourably or unfavourably. There is no getting around the Other as it is introduced in its own latent and covert violence, in the hesitant counter-violence of the decolonizing subject and invariably in the counter-articulations of all projects of decolonization.

4. Tradition, Modernity and the Challenges of Development

Wiredu’s later attempts at conceptual decolonization have been quite interesting.  An example of such an attempt is the essay “Custom and Morality: A Comparative Analysis of some African and Western Conceptions of Morals.”  He is able to explore at greater length some of the conceptual confusions that arise as a result of the transplantation of Western ideas within an African frame of reference.  This wholesale transference of foreign ideas and conceptual models has caused the occurrence of severe cases of identity crises and, to borrow a more apposite term, colonial mentality.  Indeed, one of the aims of Wiredu’s efforts at conceptual decolonization is to indicate instances of colonial mentality and determine strategies by which they can be minimized.  Accordingly he is quite convincing when he argues that polygamy in a traditional setting amounts to efficient social thinking but is most inappropriate within a modern framework.  In this way, Wiredu is offering a critique of a certain traditional practice that ought to be discarded on account of the demands and realities of a modern economy.

On another level, it appears that Wiredu has not sufficiently interrogated the distance between orality and textuality.  If indeed he has done so, he would be rather more skeptical about the manner in which he thinks he can dislodge certain Western philosophical structures embedded in the African consciousness.

Wiredu has always believed that traditional modes of thought and folk philosophies should be interpreted, clarified, analyzed and subjected to critical evaluation and assimilation (Wiredu, 1980: x).  Also, at the beginning of his philosophical reflections, he puts forth the crucial formulation that there is no reason why the African philosopher “in his philosophical meditations […] should not test formulations in those against intuitions in his own language” (Wiredu, 1980: xi).  And, rather than merely discussing the possibilities for evolving modern traditions in African philosophy, African philosophers should actually begin to do so (Hountondji, 1983).  In carrying out this task, the African philosopher has a few available methodological approaches.  First, he is urged to “acquaint himself with the different philosophies of the different cultures of the world, not to be encylopaedic or eclectic, but with the aim of trying to see how far issues and concepts of universal relevance can be disentangled from the contingencies of culture” (Wiredu, 1980: 31).  He also adds that “the African philosopher has no choice but to conduct his philosophical inquiries in relation to the philosophical writings of other peoples, for his ancestors left him no heritage of philosophical writings” (Wiredu, 1980: 48).  For Wiredu, the use of translations is a fundamental aspect of contemporary African philosophical practices.  However, on the dilemmas of translation in the current age of neoliberalism, it has been noted: “translations are [..] put ‘out of joint.’  However correct or legitimate they may be, and whatever right one may acknowledge them to have, they are all disadjusted, as it were unjust in the gap that affects them.  This gap is within them, to be sure, because their meanings remain necessarily equivocal; next it is in the relation among them and thus their multiplicity, and finally or first of all in the irreducible inadequation to the other language and to the stroke of genius of the event that makes the law, to all the virtualities of the original” (Derrida, 1994:19).  Wiredu does not contemplate the implications of this kind of indictment in his formulations of an approach to African philosophy.  Perhaps the task at hand is simply too important and demanding to cater to such philosophical niceties.  In relation to the kind of philosophical heritage at the disposal of the African philosopher, Wiredu identifies three main strands; “a folk philosophy, a written traditional philosophy and a modern philosophy” (Wiredu, 1980:46).  Wiredu’s approach to questions of this sort is embedded in his general theoretical stance: “It is a function, indeed a duty, of philosophy in any society to examine the intellectual foundations of its culture.  For any such examination to be of any real use, it should take the form of reasoned criticism and, where possible, reconstruction. No other way to philosophical progress is known than through criticism and adaptation” (Wiredu, 1980: 20).

The drive to attain progress is not limited to philosophical discourse alone.  Entire communities and cultures usually aim to improve upon their institutions and practices in order to remain relevant.  Societies can lose the momentum of growth and “various habits of thought and practice can become anachronistic within the context of the development of a given society; but an entire society too can become anachronistic within the context of the whole world if the ways of life within it are predominantly anachronistic.  In the latter case, of course, there is no discarding society; what you do is to modernize it” (Wiredu, 1980:1).  The theme of modernization occurs frequently in Wiredu’s corpus.  He does not fully conceptualize it nor relate it to the various ideological histories it has encountered in the domains of social science, where it became a fully fledged discipline. Modernization, for him, is based on an uncomplicated pragmatism that owes much to Deweyan thought.

This kind of posture, that is, the consistent critique of the retrogression inherent in tradition and its proclivity for the fossilization of culture, is directed at Leopold Sedar Senghor.  On Senghor, he writes, “it is almost as if he has been trying to exemplify in his own thought and discourse the lack of the analytical habit which he has attributed to the biology of the African.  Most seriously of all, Senghor has celebrated the fact our (traditional) mind is of a non-analytical bent; which is very unfortunate, seeing that this mental attribute is more of a limitation than anything else” (Wiredu, 1980:12).  Wiredu’s main criticism of Senghor is one that is always leveled against the latter.  Apart from that charge that Senghor essentializes the concept and ideologies of blackness, he is also charged with defeatism that undermines struggles for liberation and decolonization.  However, Paul Gilroy has unearthed a more sympathetic context in which to read and situate Senghorian thought.  In Gilroy’s reading, an acceptable ideology of blackness emerges from Senghor’s work. And in this way, Wiredu’s critique loses some of its originality.

Senghor is cast as a traditionalist and tradition itself is the subject of a much broader critique.  On some of the drawbacks of tradition Wiredu writes,

it is as true in Africa as anywhere else that logical, mathematical, analytical, experimental procedures are essential in the quest for the knowledge of, and control over, nature and therefore, in any endeavour to improve the condition of man. Our traditional culture was somewhat wanting in this respect and this is largely responsible for the weaknesses of traditional technology, warfare, architecture, medicine….” (Wiredu, 1980: 12) (italics mine)

Sometimes, Wiredu carries his critique of tradition too far as when he advances the view that “traditional medicine is terribly weak in diagnosis and weaker still in pharmacology” (Wiredu, 1980: 12).  In recent times, a major part of Hountondji’s project is to demonstrate that traditional knowledges are not only useful and viable but also the necessity to situate them in appropriate modern contexts.  Hountondji’s latest gesture is curious since both he and Wiredu are supposed to belong to the same philosophic tendency as described by Bodunrin under the rubric of West-led universalism.  However, Wiredu’s attack on tradition is vitiated by his project of conceptual decolonization which, in order to work, requires the recuperation of vital elements in traditional culture.

Wiredu’s stance in relation to modernization and tradition gets refined by his condemnation of some aspects of urban existence which exhibit a manifestation of postmodern environmentalism. First, he writes, “it is quite clear to me that unrestricted industrial urbanization is contrary to any humane culture; it is certainly contrary to our own” (Wiredu, 1980:22). Also, “one of the powerful strains on our extended family system is the very extensive poverty which oppresses out rural populations. Owing to this, people working in the towns and cities are constantly burdened with the financial needs of rural relatives which they usually cannot entirely satisfy”(Wiredu, 1980:22). Contemporary anthropological studies dealing with Africa have dwelt extensively on this phenomenon. The point is, in Africa, forms of sociality exists that can no longer be found in the North Atlantic civilization. If this civilization (the North Atlantic) is characterized by extreme individualism, African forms of social existence on the other hand tend towards the gregarious in which conceptions of generosity, corruption, gratitude, philanthropy, ethnicity  and even justice take on different slightly forms from what obtains within the vastly different North Atlantic context.

Also problematic is Wiredu’s reading of colonialism which is very similar to those of authors such as Ngugi wa Thiongo, Walter Rodney or even Chinua Achebe. In this reading, the colonized is abused, brutalized, silenced and reconstructed against her/his own will.  Colonialism causes the destruction of agency. On de-agentialization, Wiredu states, “any human arrangement is authoritarian if it entails any person being made to do or suffer something against his will, or if it leads to any person being hindered in the development of his own will” (Wiredu, 1980:2).  Homi Bhabha advances the notion of ambivalence to highlight the cultural reciprocities inherent in the entire colonial encounter and structure. This kind of reading of the colonial event has led to a rethinking of colonial theory. But Wiredu’s reading of the colonial encounter is infected by the radical persuasion of early African theorists of decolonization: “The period of colonial struggle was […] a period of cultural affirmation. It was necessary to restore in ourselves our previous confidence which had been so seriously eroded by colonialism. We are still, admittedly, even in post-colonial times, in an era of cultural self-affirmation” (Ibid.59).

5. An African Reading of Karl Marx

Marxist theory and discourse generally provided many African intellectuals with a platform on which to conduct many sociopolitical struggles. In fact, for many African scholars, it served as the only ideological tool. But not all scholars found Marxism acceptable. Wiredu was one of the scholars who has deep reservations about it. But he is not in doubt about the philosophical significance of Marx: “I regard Karl Marx as one of the great philosophers” (Wiredu, 1980:63). Derrida is even more forthcoming on the depth of this significance: “It will always be a fault not to read and reread and discuss Marx- which is to say also a few others- and to go beyond scholarly “reading” or “discussion.” It will be more and more a fault, a failing of theoretical, philosophical, political responsibility” (Derrida, 1994:13). Again, he writes, “the Marxist inheritance was- and still remains, and so it will remain- absolutely and thoroughly determinate. One need not be a Marxist or a communist in order to accept this obvious fact. We all live in a world, some would say a culture, that bears, at an incalculable depth, the mark of this inheritance, whether in a directly visible fashion or not”(Ibid.).

Marxism during era of the Cold War was the major ideological issue and in the present age of neoliberalism it continues to haunt (Derrida’s precise phrase is hauntology) us with its multiple legacies. Wiredu’s critique of Marx and Engels is located within the epoch of the Cold War. But from it, we get a glimpse of not only his political orientation but also his philosophical predilections. For instance, at a point, he claims “the food one eats, the hairstyle one adopts, the amount of money one has, the power one wields- all these and such circumstances are irrelevant from an epistemological point of view” (Wiredu, 1980:66). But Foucault-style analyses have demonstrated that these seemingly marginal activities have a tremendous impact on knowledge/power configurations that are often difficult to ignore. Michel de Certeau has demonstrated these so-called inconsequential acts become significant as gestures of resistance for the benefit of the weak and politically powerless. In his words, “the weak must continually turn to their own ends forces alien to them” (de Certeau 1984: xix). On those specific acts of the weak, he writes, “many everyday practices (talking, reading, moving about, shopping, cooking, etc.) are tactical in character. And so are, more generally, many “ways of operating”: victories of the “weak” over the “strong” (whether the strength be that of powerful people or the violence of things or of an imposed order, etc.), clever tricks, knowing how to get away with things, “hunter’s cunning,” maneuvers, polymorphic simulations, joyful discoveries, poetic  as well as warlike. The Greeks called these “ways of operating” metis (Ibid.). This reading gives an entirely different perspective on acts and themes of resistance as panoptical surveillance in the age of global neoliberalism becomes more totalitarian in nature at specific moments.

As a philosopher versed in analytic philosophy, truth is a primary concern of Wiredu and this concern is incorporated into his analysis of Marxist philosophy. Hence, he identifies the following points, “the cognition of truth is recognized by Engels as the business of philosophy; (2) What is denied is absolute truth, not truth as such; (3) The belief, so finely expressed, in the progressive character of truth; (4) Engels speaks of this process of cognition as the ‘development of science.’ (5) That a consciousness of limitation is a necessary element in all acquired knowledge” (Wiredu,1980:64-65). Wiredu explains that these various Marxian assertions on truth are no different from those of the logician, C. S. Peirce who had expounded them under a formulation he called “fallibilism.” John Dewey also expounded them under the concept of ‘pragmatism’(Ibid.67). So the point here is that some of the main Marxist propositions on truth have parallels in analytic philosophy. Nonetheless, this raises an unsettling question about Marxism and its relation to truth: “How is it that a philosophy which advocates such an admirable doctrine as the humanistic conception of truth tends so often to lead in practice to the suppression of freedom of thought and expression? Is it by accident that this comes to be so? Or is it due to causes internal to the philosophy of Marx and Engels”(Ibid.68). Wiredu demonstrates strong reservations about what Ernest Wamba dia Wamba calls ‘bureaucratic socialism.” Derrida on his part, urges us to distinguish between Marx as a philosopher and the innumerable specters of Marx. In other words, there is a difference between “the dogma machine and the “Marxist” ideological apparatuses (States, parties, cells, unions, and other places of doctrinal production)”(Derrida,1994:13)  and the necessity to treat Marx as a great philosopher. We need to “try to play Marx off against Marxism so as to neutralize, or at any rate muffle the political imperative in the untroubled exegesis of classified work” (Ibid.31).  We also need to remember that “he doesn’t belong to the communists, to the Marxists, to the parties, he ought to figure within our great canon of […] political philosophy” (Ibid.31).

Wiredu’s reading of Marxism generally is quite damaging. First, he states, “Engels himself, never perfectly consistent, already compromises his conception of truth with some concessions to absolute truth in Anti-Duhring” (Wiredu, 1980:68). He then makes an even more damaging accusation that a form of authoritarianism lies at the heart of conception of philosophy propagated by Marx and Engels.  On what he considers to a deep-seated confusion in their work, he writes, “Engels recognizes the cognition of truth to be a legitimate business of philosophy and makes a number of excellent points about truth. As soon, however, as one tries to find out what he and Marx conceived philosophy to be like, one is faced with a deep obscurity. The problem resolves round what one may describe as Marx’s conception of philosophy as ideology” (Ibid.70). Here, Wiredu makes the crucial distinction between Marx as a philosopher and the effects of his numerous spectralities and for this reason he offers his most important criticism of his general critique of Marxism. He also accuses Marx of instances of “carelessness in the use of cardinal terms” which he says “may be symptomatic of deep inadequacies of thought”(Ibid.74). This charge, which relates to Marx’s conception of consciousness is indeed serious since it borders on the question of conceptual clarification as advanced by the canon of analytic philosophy. Wiredu argues that Marx and Engels are unclear about their employment of the concept of ideology: “Marx and Engels are […] on the horns of a dilemma. If all philosophical thinking is ideological, then their thinking is ideological and, by their hypothesis, false”(Ibid.76). Wiredu’s insights are very important here: “He and Engels simply assumed for themselves the privilege of exempting their own philosophizing from the ideological theory of ideas”(Ibid.77). Consequently, Marx commits a grave error “in his conception of ideology and its bearing upon philosophy”(Ibid.81).

Another area Wiredu finds Marx and Engels wanting is moral philosophy. In other words, Marx “confused moral philosophy with moralism and assumed rather than argued a moral standpoint”(Ibid.79). Furthermore, he had precious little to say on the nature of the relationship between philosophy and morality. Engels does better on this score as there is a treatment of morality in Anti-Duhring. Nonetheless, Engels is charged with giving “no guidance on the conceptual problems that have perplexed moral philosophers” (Ibi.80). Henceforth, Wiredu becomes increasing dismissive of Marx, Marxism and its followers. First, he writes, “the run-of the-mill Marxists, even less enamoured of philosophical accuracy than their masters, have made the ideological conception of philosophy a battle cry”(Ibid.80). And then he singles out ‘scientific socialism’ which he regards as being unclear in its elaboration and which he typifies as “an amalgam of factual and evaluative elements blended together without regard to categorical stratification”(Ibid.85). In one of his most damaging assessments of Marxism, he declares: “Ideology is the death of philosophy. To the extent to which Marxism, by its own internal incoherences, tends to be transformed into an ideology, to that extent Marxism is a science of the unscientific and a philosophy of the unphilosophic” (Ibid.87).

In sum, Wiredu general attitude towards Marxism is one of condemnation. However, in the contemporary re-evaluations of Marxism a few discursive elements need to be clarified; the inclusion of the demarcation of Cold War and post Cold War assessments of Marxism ought to be employed as an analytical yardstick and also the necessity to sift through the various specters and legacies of Marx as distinct from those of Marxism. This is the kind of reading that Derrida urges us to do and it is also one to which we shall now turn our attention.

Derrida states it is imperative to distinguish between the legacies of Marx and the various spectralities of Marxism. In addition to this distinction we might add another crucial one: analyses of Marxism before and after the fall of the former Soviet Union. Wiredu’s critique is based on the pre-Soviet debacle whilst Derrida’s draws some of his reflections based on the post-Soviet fall. In these two different critiques, we must be careful to always strive to isolate the theoretical elements and insights that bypass short-lived discursive trends and political interests which often tend to vitiate the more profound effects of the works of Karl Marx and those that do not.

The debacle of the former Soviet Union and the apparent hegemony of neoliberal ideology have generated discourses associated with the “ends” of discourse. But Derrida points out that there is nothing new in the contemporary proclamations affirming the end of discourses which are in fact anachronistic when compared to the earlier versions of the same discursive orientation that emerged in the 1950s and which in a vital sense owed a great deal to a certain spirit of Marx: “the eschatological themes of the “end of history,” of the “end of Marxism,” of the “end of philosophy,” of the “ends of man,” of the “last man” and so forth were, in the ‘50s, that is, forty years ago our daily bread. We had this bread of apocalypse in our mouths naturally, already, just as naturally as that which I nicknamed after the fact, in 1980, the “apocalyptic tone in philosophy” (Derrida, 1994:14-15). In a way, in fact the contemporary discourses of endism that draw from the spirit of neoliberal triumphalism, without acknowledging it, are greatly indebted to Marxism and the more constructive critiques of it. Deconstruction, in part, emerged from the necessity to critique the various forms of statist Stalinism, the numerous socio-economic failings of Soviet bureaucracy and the political repression in Hungary. In other words, it emerged partly from the need to organize critiques for degraded forms of socialism.

In speaking about the inheritance of Marx, Derrida also reflects on the injunction associated with it. The task of reflecting on this inheritance and the injunction to which it gives rise is demanding: … “one must filter, sift, criticize, one must sort out several different possibles that inhabit the same injunction. And inhabit it in a contradictory fashion around a secret. If the readability of a legacy were given, natural, transparent, univocal, if it did not call for and at the same time defy interpretation, we would never have anything to inherit from it” (Ibid.16). Derrida’s employment of terms and phrases such “inheritance,” “injunction,” and the “spectrality of the specter” in relation to the legacies of Marx has to do with the question of the genius of Marx: “Whether evil or not, a genius operates, it always resists and defies after the fashion of a spectral thing. The animated work becomes that thing, the Thing that, like an elusive specter, engineers [s’ingenie] a habitation without proper inhabiting, call it is a haunting, of both memory and translation” (Ibid.18).

A work of genius, a masterpiece in addition to giving rise to spectralities also generates legions of imitators and followers. Of the Marxists who came after Marx, Wiredu writes; “I find that Marxists are especially prone to confuse factual with ideological issues. Undoubtedly, the great majority of those who call themselves Marxists do not share the ideology of Marx”(Wiredu,1980:94). In order to transcend the violence and confusion of Marxists who misread Marx, we need “to play Marx off against Marxism so as to neutralize, or at any rate muffle the political imperative in the untroubled exegesis of a classified work”(Derrida,1994:31). The work of re-reading Marx, of re-establishing his philosophical value and importance is a task needs to be performed in universities, conferences, colloquia and also in less academic sites and fora.

Within the contemporary cultural moment, new configurations have arisen that were not present during Marx’s day. Indeed, “a set of transformations of all sorts (in particular, techno-scientific-economic-media) exceeds both the traditional givens of the Marxist discourse and those of the liberal discourse opposed to it”(Ibid.70). Also,

Electoral representativity or parliamentary life is not only distorted, as was always the case, by a great number of socio-economic mechanisms, but it is exercised with more and more difficulty in a public space profoundly upset by techno-tele-media apparatuses and by new rhythms of information and communication, by the devices and the speed of forces represented by the latter, but also and consequently by the new modes of appropriation they put to work, by the new structure of the event and of its spectrality that they produce.” (Ibid.79)

Here, the instructive point is that the new information technologies have radically transformed the possibilities of the event and the modes of its production, reception and also interpretation. But there is a far more radical change that has occurred and which signals a profound crisis of global capitalism and the neoliberal ideology that underpins it: “For what must be cried out, at a time when some have the audacity to neo-evangelize in the name of the ideal of liberal democracy that has finally realized itself  as the ideal of human history: never have violence, inequality, exclusion, famine, and thus economic oppression affected as many human beings in the history of the earth and of humanity”(Ibid.85). Also, “never have so many men, women, and children been subjugated, starved, or exterminated on the earth.” (Ibid.)

So Derrida identifies a few new factors that need to be included in the critique of Marxism in the contemporary moment namely the phenomenon of spectralization caused by techno-science and digitalization, the weakening of the practice of liberal democracy and also the crises and multiple contradictions inherent in global capitalism. It is necessary to include another element into the present configuration which is the rise of political Islam as an alternative ideology, its subsequent fervent politicization and its Western reconstruction into an ideology of terror.

Wiredu’s reading of Marx focuses on the conceptual infelicities in the latter’s theorizations of notions such as “ideology,” “consciousness,” and “truth.” Wiredu also criticizes Marx’s project of moral philosophy or in fact the lack of it. On the whole, his reading isn’t complementary. Indeed, it amounts to a dismissal of Marx in spite of the attempt to read him without the obfuscations of innumerable legacies.

6. Conclusion

Arguably, Wiredu’s particular contribution to the debate on the origins, status, problematic and future of contemporary African philosophy resides in his formulations regarding his theory of conceptual decolonization. His approach in formulating this theory of discursive agency and more specifically philosophical practice involves the incorporation of a form bi-culturalism. In other words, his approach entails analyses of the canon of Western philosophy and also the manifestations of tribal cultures as a way of attaining a conceptual synthesis. Indeed, this schema involves a forceful element of bi-culturalism as a matter of logical consequence as well as a high level of [multi] bi-lingual competence. As such, it not only an exercise in conceptual synthesis but it is also a project involving comparative linguistics.

In Anglophone parts of Africa, Wiredu’s experience and research in teaching African philosophy has had a tremendous significance. The positive aspect of this is that the study of African philosophical thought has in positive moments transcended the problematic of identity or what has been termed as the problematic of origins. The less complimentary dimension of this equation is that Wiredu’s discoveries have given rise to (most undoubtedly unwittingly) a somewhat hegemonic school of disciples that is fostering a delimiting academicism and which is contrary to his essential spirit of conceptual inventiveness. As such, it might become necessary not only to critique Wiredu’s corpus but perhaps also Wiredu’s school of disciples which rather than appreciate the originality of his formulations fall instead for the pitfalls of over-ideologization.

Undoubtedly, Wiredu discovered a challenging path in modern African thought in which he sometimes takes the meaning of the existence of African philosophy for granted. In addition, it has been observed that also lacking at some moments in his oeuvre is an attempt to de-totalize and hence particularize the components of what he regards of the foundations of African philosophy.  In other words, African philosophy finds its form, shape and also its conceptual moorings above the discursive platform provided by Western philosophy. In addition, the theoretical space made available for its articulation is derived from the same Western-donated pool of unanimism. Part of recent interrogations of Wiredu’s work includes a questioning of the legitimacy of that space as the only site on which to construct an entire philosophical practice for the alienated, hybrid African consciousness. Oftentimes the question is posed, what are the ways by which the space can be broadened?

Indeed, terms such as reflective integration and due reflection offer the critical spaces for the theoretical articulation of something whose existence has not yet been concretely conceived. So in Wiredu’s corpus we see the very familiar problematic involving the tradition/modernity dichotomy being played out. Finally, it can be argued that this tension is not quite resolved but fortunately it is also a tension that never jeopardizes his philosophical inventiveness. Rather, it seems to animate his reflections in unprecedented ways.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Cronon, D. E. 1955. Black Moses: The Story of Marcus Garvey and the Universal Negro Improvement Association, Wisconsin: University of Wisconsin Press.
  • Cummings, Robert. 1986. “Africa between the Ages” in African Studies Review, Vol. 29, No. 3, September.
  • Diop, Cheikh, Anta, 1974. The African Origin of Civilization: Myth or Reality? Trans. M. Cook, Westport, Conn.: Lawrence Hill.
  • Doortmont, Michel R. 2005 The Pen-Pictures of Modern Africans and African Celebrities by Charles Francis Hutchison,  Leiden and Boston: Brill.
  • Dubow, Saul. 2000 The African National Congress, Johannesburg: Jonathan Ball.
  • Derrida, Jacques. 1994. Specters of Marx: the state of the debt, the work of mourning, & the new international, trans. Peggy Kamuf, New York: Routledge.
  • Gates Jr., H. L. 1992. Loose Canons, New York: OxfordUniversity Press.
  • Fanon, Frantz. 1967 Black Skin, White Masks (trans. C. Van Markmann) New York: Grove Press.
  • Fanon, Frantz. 1963 The Wretched of the Earth, London: Penguin.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1974 The Order of Things: An Archaeology of the Human Sciences. New York: Pantheon.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1977 Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison. Trans A. M. Sheridan-Smith. London: Allen Lane.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1980 Language, Counter-Memory and Practice. Selected Essays and Interviews. Ed. Donald Bouchard, Ithaca, NY: CornellUniversity Press.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1982 The Archaeology of Knowledge. New York: Pantheon.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1991 “Governmentality” in G. Burchell, C. Gordon and P. Miller, eds, The Foucault Effect.Chicago: Chicago University Press.
  • Hountondji, Paulin. 1983 African Philosophy: Myth and Reality, London: Hutchinson and Co.
  • Hountondji, Paulin.  2002 The Struggle for Meaning: Reflections on Philosophy, Culture and Democracy in Africa, Athens: Ohio University Center for International Studies.
  • Masolo, D.A. 1994 African Philosophy in Search of Identity Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Mudimbe V.Y. 1988 The Invention of Africa Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Mudimbe V.Y. 1994. The Idea of Africa,Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Oladipo,  Olusegun. ed. 2002  The Third Way in African Philosophy:Essays in Honour of Kwasi WireduIbadan: Hope Publications Ltd.
  • Osha, Sanya, 2005 Kwasi Wiredu and Beyond: The Text, Writing and Thought in Africa, Dakar: Codesria.
  • Soyinka, Wole, 1976 Myth, Literature and the African World Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole,   1988 Art, Dialogue and Outrage Ibadan: New Horn Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole, 1996 The Open Sore of a Continent New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole.  1999 The Burden of Memory, The Muse of Forgiveness New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole. 2000 “Memory, Truth and Healing” in The Politics of Memory, Truth, Healing and Social Justice, eds. I. Amaduime and A. An-Na’im, London: Zed Books
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1972 HomecomingLondon, Ibadan, Lusaka: Heinemann.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1981 Writers in PoliticsNairobi: Heinemann.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1986 Decolonising the MindNairobi: E.A.E.P.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1993 Moving the CentreLondon: James Currey.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. Philosophy and an African CultureCambridge: CambridgeUniversity Press, 1980.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi.  1983 “The Akan Concept of Mind” in Ibadan Journal of Humanistic Studies, No. 3.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1985 “The Concept of Truth in Akan Language” in P.O. Bodunrin ed. Philosophy in Africa: Trends and Perspectives, Ile-Ife: University of Ife Press.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. and Gyekye, Kwame. 1992 Persons and Community. Washington, D.C.: The Council for Research in Values and Philosophy.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1993 “Canons of Conceptualisation” in The Monist: An International Journal of General Philosophical Inquiry Vol. 76, No. 4 October.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1995 Conceptual Decolonization in African PhilosophyIbadan: Hope Publications.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi.  1996 Cultural Universals and ParticularsBloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Yai, Olabiyi. 1977 “The Theory and Practice in African Philosophy: The Poverty of Speculative Philosophy,” Second Order: An African Journal of Philosophy, Vol.VI, No.2.


Author Information

Sanya Osha
Tshwane University of Technology
South Africa


Cultural diversity has been present in societies for a very long time. In Ancient Greece, there were various small regions with different costumes, traditions, dialects and identities, for example, those from Aetolia, Locris, Doris and Epirus. In the Ottoman Empire, Muslims were the majority, but there were also Christians, Jews, pagan Arabs, and other religious groups. In the 21st century, societies remain culturally diverse, with most countries having a mixture of individuals from different races, linguistic backgrounds, religious affiliations, and so forth. Contemporary political theorists have labeled this phenomenon of the coexistence of different cultures in the same geographical space multiculturalism. That is, one of the meanings of multiculturalism is the coexistence of different cultures.

The term ‘multiculturalism’, however, has not been used only to describe a culturally diverse society, but also to refer to a kind of policy that aims at protecting cultural diversity. Although multiculturalism is a phenomenon with a long history and there have been countries historically that did adopt multicultural policies, like the Ottoman Empire, the systematic study of multiculturalism in philosophy has only flourished in the late twentieth century, when it began to receive special attention, especially from liberal philosophers. The philosophers who initially dedicated more time to the topic were mainly Canadian, but in the 21st century it is a widespread topic in contemporary political philosophy. Before multiculturalism became a topic in political philosophy, most literature in this area focused on topics related to the fair redistribution of resources; conversely, the topic of multiculturalism in the realm of political philosophy highlights the idea that cultural identities are also normatively relevant and that policies ought to take these identities into consideration.

To understand the discussion of multiculturalism in contemporary political philosophy, there are four key topics that should be taken into consideration; these are the meaning of the concept of ‘culture’, the meaning of the concept of ‘multiculturalism’, the debate about justice between cultural groups and the discussion regarding the practical implications of multicultural practices.

Table of Contents

  1. The Concepts of Culture in Contemporary Political Theory
    1. The Semiotic Perspective
    2. The Normative Conception
    3. The Societal Conception
    4. The Economic/Rational Choice Approach
    5. Anti-Essentialism and Cosmopolitanism
  2. The Concept of Multiculturalism
    1. Multiculturalism as a Describing Concept for Society
    2. Multiculturalism as a Policy
      1. Multicultural Citizenship
        1. Taylor's Politics of Recognition
        2. Kymlicka's Multicultural Liberalism
        3. Shachar's Transformative Accommodation
      2. Negative Universalism
        1. Barry's Liberal Egalitarianism
        2. Kukathas' Libertarianism
  3. The Second Wave of Writings on Multiculturalism
    1. Gays, Lesbians and Bisexuals
    2. Women
    3. Children
  4. Animals and Multiculturalism
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Concepts of Culture in Contemporary Political Theory

Multiculturalism is before anything else a theory about culture and its value. Hence, to understand what multiculturalism is it is indispensable that the meaning of culture is clarified. In this section, five concepts of culture that are predominant in contemporary political philosophy are outlined: semiotic, normative, societal, economic/rational choice and the anti-essentialist cosmopolitanism conceptions of culture. As Festenstein (2005) points out, these are not competing conceptions of culture, where each selects a distinct set of necessary and sufficient conditions for the right application of the predicate. Contrastingly, all these conceptions of culture defend, even though in slightly different ways, the idea that culture is constitutive of personal identity. Therefore, it is possible to simultaneously defend, say, a semiotic conception of culture and admit that a culture may have normative, societal, economic and cosmopolitan features.

a. The Semiotic Perspective

The semiotic conception of culture was very popular in the 1960s, and has its roots in classic social anthropology. Social anthropologists like Margaret Mead, Levi-Straus and Malinowski considered culture as a set of social systems, symbols, representations and practices of signification held by a certain group. Thus, from this perspective, a culture is defined as a system of ideals or structures of symbolic meaning. Put differently, according to this view, culture should be understood as a symbolic system which in turn is a way of communication which represents the world. This form of communication is based on symbols, underlying structures and beliefs or ideological principles. One of the philosophers endorsing this perspective of culture is Parekh (2005). According to Parekh (2005, p. 139), human life is organized by a historically created system of meaning and significance and in turn this is what we call culture.

Taylor (1994b) who contends that human beings are self-interpreting animals, that is, human beings’ identities depend on the way each individual sees them self, also endorses this viewpoint. These self-understandings necessarily have to have meaning. Hence, the thesis that human beings are self-interpreting animals presupposes that human existence is constituted by meaning. In turn, this implies that human beings are also language animals. By language, what is meant are all modes of expression (music, spoken language, art and so forth) (Taylor, 1994b). To be language animals means that individuals are capable of creating value and meaning, and in Taylor’s view, these meanings have their origins in each individual’s cultural community. That is to say, language is, at least primarily, a result of the interaction of individuals with their own cultural community (Taylor, 1974; 1994b). More precisely, linguistic meanings and self-interpretations have their origins in individuals’ linguistic communities. Thus, culture is a system of symbolic meaning.

Bearing this in mind, it can be argued that the study of culture from the semiotic perspective is the analysis or elucidation of meaning. As in hermeneutics, where the reader has to interpret the meaning of a text, in culture one has to interpret its internal logic (Festenstein, 2005). An example of interpreting the internal logic of a culture could be given by the story told by Quine (1960) regarding the native who says ‘Gavagai!’ whenever he sees a rabbit. Quine (1960) suggests that there may be multiple meanings associated with this actions; it may mean ‘rabbit’, ‘food’, ‘an undetached rabbit-part’, ‘there will be a storm tonight’ (if the native is superstitious) and so forth. The symbolism, sign process or system of meaning underlying this action is what, according to the point of view of semiotics, culture is, and this is what should be studied. In short, it is the study of culture’s autonomous logic.

b. The Normative Conception

The normative conception of culture is usually adopted by communitarians. From this point of view, culture is important because it is what provides beliefs, norms and moral reasons, prompting individuals to act. Hence, part of what a person is includes their moral commitments; their practical identity is made up of these moral commitments, while their reasons to act are motivated by their moral commitments. In other words, according to the normative conception of culture, the term ‘culture’ refers to a group of norms and beliefs that are distinctive and which constitute the practical identify of a group of individuals; thereby, people’s values and commitments result, in part, from culture (Festenstein, 2005, p. 14). By way of illustration, part of what a Christian, a Muslim and a Jew are is constituted by the fact they abide or follow the moral teachings of the Bible, the Quran and the Torah, respectively. Therefore, understanding who one is is about understanding one’s moral commitments and therefore culture is norm-providing. Shachar (2001a, p. 2) is one of the philosophers who endorses this conception of culture. According to her, culture is a world view, both comprehensive and distinguishable, whereby community law is able to be created. To minority groups that have a culture, Shachar (2001a, p.2) attaches the label ‘nomoi communities’. According to her, this term can apply to religious, ethnic, racial, tribal and national groups, for all these groups exhibit the normative dimension required to be classified as a ‘nomoi community’.

The normative conception of culture is usually associated with the semiotic, in the sense that one does not contradict the other; in fact, they may be complementary. For instance, Taylor endorses both perspectives of culture. However, this is not necessary because the system of meaning and significance does not need to provide moral reasons in order to motivate action. From the semiotic perspective, what someone is is not necessarily his or her moral commitments; it can be anything within the system. That is, the system of meaning may be based on anything while, according to the normative conception of culture, culture is strong source of one’s moral commitments.

To explain how the semiotic and normative conceptions of culture can be compatible, consider Taylor’s conception of culture. Taylor considers that individuals are self-interpreting animals. The fact that individuals are thus entails that human existence is constituted by meanings. From the normative point of view, these meanings are moral evaluations/strong evaluations. This refers to the distinctions of worth that individuals make regarding objects of desire. In other words, it is a background of distinctions between things that individuals consider important or worthy and those things which are considered less valuable. From the normative perspective of culture, individuals direct their lives and purposes towards what they consider morally worthwhile. In short, these strong evaluations or moral frameworks are what indicate to individuals what is meaningful and rewarding. That is, they are motivated by these evaluations (Taylor, 1974). Therefore, the self has a moral dimension, in the sense that rationality and identity refer to moral evaluations. Identity is connected with morality because what individuals are is constituted by their self-interpretations, which are ultimately provided by strong evaluations (Taylor, 1974). These moral beliefs or strong evaluations are in turn provided by an individual’s culture–that is why this can be considered a normative conception of culture.

c. The Societal Conception

The societal conception of culture is a concept mainly used by the Canadian philosopher Kymlicka. In order to understand this, it is helpful to consider Kymlicka’s dual typology of the sources of diversity that exist in contemporary societies; for Kymlicka there are two kinds of diversity: polyethnic minorities and national minorities.

Kymlicka uses the term polyethnicity to refer to the kind of diversity resulting from immigration. Polyethnic minorities refer to what is commonly defined as ethnic groups. According to him, polyethnic groups are usually not territorially concentrated; rather they are dispersed around the country to which they migrated. Furthermore, Kymlicka affirms that they do not usually want to be segregated from the culture of the majority; rather they want to integrate with it, demanding policies that give them equal citizenship. For instance, these groups demand language rights, voting rights, places in parliament and so forth. However, even though this demand for equal citizenship is usually what polyethnic groups aspire to, this is not always the case. Kymlicka contends that polyethnic groups can be sub-divided into liberal and illiberal groups (Kymlicka, 2001, pp. 55-58). Liberal polyethnic groups have aspirations that do not go against liberal values, usually aspiring to be integrated into society, demanding policies for equal citizenship. As an example, Kymlicka usually refers to Latin-American immigrants living in the United States, who, in broad terms, make demands for language rights, such as an education curriculum in Spanish.

On the other hand, for Kymlicka, illiberal polyethnic groups are those where the culture and the demands to the state are not in accordance with liberal values. For example, some religious minority ethnic groups advocate the death penalty for gays within their groups; others have gendered and discriminatory norms in relation to divorce and marriage. Some of these groups have demands that are more similar to the ones of national minorities but Kymlicka contends that these cases are the exception, not the rule (Kymlicka, 1995, pp. 11-26, 97-99).

Polyethnic groups are not, in Kymlicka’s view, considered a culture; according to him, only nations are a culture. Kymlicka (1995, p. 18) uses the term nation interchangeably with the terms culture, people and societal culture, for example, “I am using ‘a culture’ as synonymous with ‘a nation’ or ‘a people’—that is, as an intergenerational community, more or less institutionally complete, occupying a given territory or homeland, sharing a distinct language and history”. In Kymlicka’s view, national minorities are a group in a society with a societal culture and a smaller number of members than the majority. Hence, a national minority is a societal culture where the amount of members is smaller in number than the amount of members of the majority. For Kymlicka (1995, p. 76) a societal culture is a kind of social setting that provides individuals with meaningful ways of life, both in the public and private sphere. These societal cultures are important mainly because they give individuals the groundwork from which they can make choices. More precisely for Kymlicka (1995, p. 76) due to the fact that societal cultures provide meaningful ways of life, they provide the social context that individuals need in order to make their own choices (that is, to be autonomous). Kymlicka’s rationale is that autonomy is only possible in certain social contexts and that social context is set up by societal cultures.

From Kymlicka’s point of view, national minorities or minority societal cultures usually share a number of characteristics. First, national minorities have settled in the country long ago. For example, most of the Amish communities in Pennsylvania settled there in the eighteenth century, as a result of religious persecution in Europe. Aborigines in Australia and many Native American groups in the USA have lived in that territory for a long period. Second, from Kymlicka’s point of view, these groups are often territorially concentrated; for example, Quebec and Catalonia are situated in specific geographic areas of Canada and Spain, respectively. In India, Sikhs are geographically concentrated mostly in the Punjab region. Third, according to Kymlicka, the institutions and practices of these groups provide a full range of human activities; this means that nations are embodied in common economic, political and educational institutions. These institutions are not based only on shared meanings, memories and values but include common practices and procedures. Put differently, nations are institutionally complete in the sense that they encompass a wide institutional elaboration that encompasses a variety of areas of life; they have their own governments, laws, schools and so forth. In Kymlicka’s view, the fourth characteristic that national minorities have in common is that they usually aspire to either total or partial segregation from the larger society. That is, these groups wish to be a totally or partially separate society, with a different state, governed by their own laws and institutions. Hence, national minorities, in Kymlicka’s view, do not want to integrate in the larger society; rather they wish to be able to have a certain degree of autonomy. For example, many Quebecois want to be able to have their own government institutions, run in the way they wish, like schools run in French. Often, the Amish want to be left alone, without intervention from the state in their internal affairs. More precisely, one of the demands of some Amish communities is that they are exempt from the basic educational requirements that other citizens of the USA have to abide by, namely, the minimum literacy requirements. This, as will be explained later on, relates to other set of normative questions about what groups can and cannot impose to their members. In order to address this problem, Kymlicka draws a distinction between practices that can be imposed (external protections) and practices that cannot be imposed (internal restrictions).

From Kymlicka’s point of view, national minorities can further be sub-divided into liberal and illiberal minorities. The former are those whose demands are compatible with liberal values, that is, their demands do not violate individuals’ rights and liberties. Under the concept of liberal national minorities are examples like Quebecois and Catalonians; these national minorities usually demand the right to use a different language in schools and their other institutions, and this does not necessarily violate any liberal value. The concept of illiberal national minorities refers to groups that wish to endorse illiberal values, like the death penalty for gays and lesbians.

d. The Economic/Rational Choice Approach

Rational choice is a theory that aims to explain and predict social behavior. From the viewpoint of rational choice, individuals act self-interestedly when they take into consideration their preferences and the information available. Self-interest means that individuals tend to maximize what is valuable for them. In other words, human behavior is goal-oriented. It is goal oriented by its preferences, that is, individuals act according to their preferences. For instance, if an individual prefers a hot chocolate to a vanilla milkshake or a strawberry milkshake and all the options are available, he will choose hot chocolate (other things being equal).

According to the rational choice view, the information available strongly affects behavior. By way of illustration, if an individual does not know that hot chocolate is available he will not choose it. Thus individuals act according to their self-interest, information and preferences. If a certain person’s preference is to buy the tastiest hot chocolate and this person has the information that the tastiest hot chocolate is sold ina particular store, then this person will act in order to achieve her/his own interest, that is, by going to that store and purchasing it there. Obviously, these actions are limited by the options available and by the actions of others. Therefore, if there is no hot chocolate on the market, this person will not be able to buy it–the option is not available because the suppliers decided not to offer hot chocolate. In this sense, an individual’s are dependent on their circumstances and on the actions of others.

With these premises in mind, a possible definition of culture from a rational choice perspective is provided by Laitin (2007, p. 64), whereby culture is:

an equilibrium in a well-defined set of circumstances in which members of a group sharing in common descent, symbolic practices and/or high levels of interaction—and thereby becoming a cultural group—are able to condition their behavior on common knowledge beliefs about the behavior of all members of the group.

Therefore, there are four key features of this conception of culture. First, a cultural group is a group in which individuals share a certain number of characteristics that differentiate them from other individuals–for example, language or religion. Second, all these individuals share a high degree of common knowledge. What common knowledge means in this context is that the members of a certain culture have shared information and mutual expectations about the actions and beliefs of others in the group. Third, there is a cultural equilibrium when the incentive to act or the self-interest to act is according to the beliefs of his or her own culture. More precisely, a cultural equilibrium occurs when individuals’ have an interest in acting in accordance with the norms and practices of their culture. These norms and practices can be any, but Laitin (2007) provides an insightful example with respect to the old Chinese tradition of foot binding. Laitin explains that it was very difficult for Chinese women to marry a man if they did not engage in the foot binding tradition. In this case, most Chinese parents forced their daughters to engage in this practice owing to the fact that their interest in finding a husband to their daughters was in accordance with the cultural practice of foot binding.  Finally, a well-defined set of circumstances can be described as a kind of situation where the type of interactions that members have with each other are ones of coordination and not conflict. That is, individuals’ actions are ones that are arranged in a way that match or complement each other, rather than being in conflict.

e. Anti-Essentialism and Cosmopolitanism

The concepts of culture mentioned above have been strongly criticized by some political theorists. Some of these, who direct their criticisms mostly to the semiotic, normative and societal conceptions of culture, argue that these conceptions are essentialist views of culture that inaccurately describe social reality. However, as Festenstein (2005) has pointed out, these criticisms are sometimes misplaced, that is, these conceptions of culture do not necessarily need to be essentialist.

In general terms, from an essentialist point of view, there is a distinction between the essential and accidental properties that the different kinds of objects and subjects may have. Accidental properties are properties that are not necessarily present in all members of a certain group of objects or subjects. Essential properties are those that define the objects or subjects, that is, objects or subjects necessarily need to have these properties in order to be members of a certain group. Furthermore, members of other groups do not have this property or set of properties; otherwise they too would belong to this group. By way of illustration, a bookshelf in order to be a bookshelf has to necessarily be constructed in a way that makes it possible to hold books–this is its essential property. The fact that a specific bookshelf is brown, black or blue is an accidental property–it does not change what the object is and it is indifferent to its definition. These properties are necessary and sufficient not only to include a certain object or subject in the group but also to exclude any object or subject which does not share these properties. Bearing this in mind, it can be concluded that essences are given by differences and similarities; for what defines a subject is what it has in common with the subjects of the same group, which in turn is a characteristic that other groups do not have.

In terms of what this means to culture, it means identifying the social characteristics or attributes that make the group what it is, and that all members of that group necessarily share. Moreover, these characteristics are what differentiate members of that group from others and clearly exclude others (Young, 2000a, p. 87). For example, for an essentialist, to classify Muslims as Muslims means to identify a certain characteristic, like shared practices and beliefs, common to all of the individuals who identify as Muslims. Thus, essentialism applied to culture would be that a certain culture means having a certain characteristic or set of characteristics that all members share, and which no one outside the group does. Hence, from this point of view, the identity of the group is constituted by the set of properties or attributes which are essential to this particular group (Young, 2000a).

According to the critics of essentialism, this theory necessarily makes two wrong assumptions about culture. First, the critics state that essentialists wrongly affirm that cultures are clearly demarcated wholes and their practices and beliefs do not overlap with other cultures. Thus, according to this argument, essentialists wrongly affirm that beliefs and practices are exclusive to each culture. This premise is necessary for defending essentialism because from an essentialist point of view; different groups cannot share the same essential properties; otherwise they would belong to the same group. Second, essentialists, according to these critics, wrongly picture cultures as internally uniform or homogeneous. Put differently, essentialists consider that individuals with the same culture all agree and interpret practices in the same way. Furthermore, they all place the same value on the practices of the group. This second premise is necessary for essentialist thinking owing to the fact that a group has to have a property or a set of properties that is predicated of all individuals in order for them to be members of this group.

This essentialist perspective of culture has however been widely contested. The general argument is that essentialism stereotypes and makes abusive generalizations of what groups are. That is to say, according to the critics, essentialism is descriptively inaccurate. Criticism of this perspective contends that the first premise lacks empirical evidence. There is no evidence that there is any exclusivity in terms of practices and beliefs, in fact, evidence suggests the opposite; cultures borrow practices and beliefs in order to increase their fitness. Cultures are not bounded, owing to the fact that culture is constantly changing, influenced by local, national and global resources (Phillips, 2007a; 2010). Hence, according to this view, it is not possible to clearly demarcate the boundaries of cultures because they share a number of practices and beliefs. There is significant overlapping of cultures, especially in neighboring cultures. The distinction between cultures is, therefore, overemphasized–the boundaries between cultures not being clearly demarcated (Benhabib, 2002; Phillips, 2007a).

With regards to the second premise, the criticism contends that it is false to say that there is internal homogeneity inside a group in terms of needs, interests and beliefs. Rather, the social actors of cultural groups have different needs, interests and interpretations about the beliefs and practices of groups. Furthermore, in many cases, they consider these practices and beliefs quite contestable, discussable and open to different interpretations. Therefore, there is wide disagreement about cultural meaning (Benhabib, 2002). Anti-essentialists contend that there are too many exceptions to make essentialist claims. Therefore, there are a considerable number of counter-examples to this generalization (Phillips, 2007a; 2010; Schachar, 2001a). As a consequence, some anti-essentialists usually argue that these categories should be substituted by thinner categories. Thus, rather than speaking about women, one should speak about black women, or lesbian Muslim women.

Taking this into consideration, different, more flexible conceptions of culture have been suggested; perhaps the most well-known being the cosmopolitan conception of culture, defended by Waldron. In Waldron’s view, cultures are dynamic and in continuous creation and interchange (Waldron, 1991). Consequently, cultures overlap with each other, making it impossible to attribute exclusive properties to one single culture and to differentiate between them. In other words, according to this view, there is a mélange of cultures because people move between cultures by enjoying the opportunities that each provides. Hence, individuals live in a kaleidoscope of cultures, within which they enjoy and borrow practices (Waldron, 1996).

A question that arises is whether this criticism entails that any attempt to define culture is mistaken. Some anti-essentialists like Narayan (1998) contend that this is not the case. Rather, she contends that cultures can be defined if two points are taken into consideration. First, cultures are fluid and constantly changing; hence, any definition of culture should consider that cultures are always in flux. Second, broader categories should be substituted by thinner categories. This means that rather than using terms like ‘African Culture’, one should use terms like ’Tutsi culture in Rwanda’.

2. The Concept of Multiculturalism

In general terms, within contemporary political philosophy, the concept of multiculturalism has been defined in two different ways. Sometimes the term ‘multiculturalism’ is used as a descriptive concept; other times it is defined as a kind of policy for responding to cultural diversity. In the next section, the definition of multiculturalism as a descriptive concept will be explained, followed by a clarification of what it means to use the term ‘multiculturalism’ as a policy.

a. Multiculturalism as a Describing Concept for Society

The term ‘multiculturalism’ is sometimes used to describe a condition of society; more precisely, it is used to describe a society where a variety of different cultures coexist. Many countries in the world are culturally diverse. Canada is just one example, including a variety of cultures such as English Canadians, Quebecois, Native Americans, Amish, Hutterites and Chinese immigrants. China is another country that can also be considered culturally diverse. In contemporary China, there are 56 officially recognized ethnic groups, and 55 of these groups are ethnic minorities who make up approximately 8.41 percent of China’s overall population. The other ethnic group is that of Han Chinese, which holds majority status (Han, 2013; He, 2006).

There are a variety of ways whereby societies can be diverse, for example, culture can come in many forms (Gurr, 1993, p. 3). Perhaps the chief ways in which a country can be culturally diverse is by having different religious groups, different linguistic groups, groups that define themselves by their territorial identity and variant racial groups.

Religious diversity is a widespread phenomenon in many countries. India can be given as an example of a country which is religiously diverse, including citizens who are Sikhs, Hindus, Buddhists, among other religious groups. The US is also religiously diverse, including Mormons, Amish, Hutterites, Catholics, Jews and so forth. These groups differentiate from each other via a variety of factors. Some of these are the Gods worshiped, the public holidays, the religious festivals and the dress codes.

Linguistic diversity is also widespread. In the 21st century, there are more than 200 countries in the world and around 6000 spoken languages (Laitin, 2007). Linguistic diversity usually results from two kinds of groups. First, it results from immigrants who move to a country where the language spoken is not their native language (Kymlicka, 1995). This is the case for those Cubans and Puerto Ricans who immigrated to the United States; it is also the case for Ukrainian immigrants who moved to Portugal.

The second kind of groups that are a cause of linguistic diversity are national minorities. National minorities are groups that have either settled in the country for a long time, but do not share the same language with the majority. Some examples include Quebecois in Canada, Catalans and Basques in Spain, and the Uyghur in China. Usually, these linguistic groups are territorially concentrated; furthermore, minority groups that fall into this category usually demand a high degree of autonomy. In particular, minority groups usually demand that they have the regional power to self-govern, that is, to run their territory as if it was an independent country or to succeed and become a different country.

A third kind of group diversity can results from distinct territory location. This territory location does not necessary mean that members of distinct cultures are, in fact, different. That is, it is not necessary that habits, traditions, customs, and so forth are significantly different. However, these distinct groups identify themselves as different from others because of the specific geographical area in which they are located. Possibly, in the UK, this is what distinguishes Scots from English. Even though there are historical differences between Scots and English, if one assumes that these two groups have little to distinguish themselves from each other, other than their geographical location, they would fit this third kind of group diversity. As mentioned above, these differences are conceptual and, in practice, cultural groups are characterized by a variety of features and not just one.

The fourth kind of group diversity is race. Races are groups whose physical characteristics are imbued with social significance. In other words, race is a socially constructed concept in the sense that it is the result of individuals giving social significance to a set of characteristics they consider that stand out in a person's physical appearance, such as skin color, eye color, hair color, bone/jaw structure and so forth. However, the mere existence of different physical characteristics does not mean that there is a multicultural environment/society. For instance, it cannot be affirmed that Sweden is multicultural because there are Swedes with blue eyes and others with green. Physical characteristics create a multicultural environment only when these physical characteristics mean that groups strongly identify with their physical characteristics and where these physical characteristics are socially perceived as something that strongly differentiates them from other groups. That is, racial cultural diversity is not simply the existence of different physical characteristics. Rather, these different physical characteristics must entail a sense of common identity which, in turn, are socially perceived as something that differentiates the members of that group to others. However, many times this idea of common identity is exaggerated, as Waldron’s argument suggests. For instance, even though there is the idea that a black culture exists in the United States, Appiah (1996) denies that such black culture exists, since there is no common identity among blacks in the United States. An example of a physical difference that is considered socially significant and, therefore, creates a multicultural society/environment can be seen in the Tutsis and Hutus of Rwanda. In general terms, Tutsis and Hutus are very similar, due to the fact that they speak the same language, share the same territory and follow the same traditions. Nevertheless, Tutsis are usually taller and thinner than Hutus. The social significance given to these physical differences are sufficient for members of both groups, broadly speaking, to identify as members of one group or the other, and subsequently oppose to each other.

Obviously, groups are not, most of the time, identified only by being linguistically different, territorially concentrated or religiously distinct. In fact, most groups have more than one of these characteristics. For instance, Sikhs in India, besides being religiously different, are also characterized, in general terms, by their geographical location. Namely, they are localized in the Punjab region of India. The Uyghur, from China, have a different language, are usually Muslims and are usually located in Xinjiang. Thus, the classification is helpful for understanding the characteristics of each group, but does not mean that these groups are simply defined by that characteristic.

b. Multiculturalism as a Policy

The term ‘multiculturalism’ can also be used to refer to a kind of policy. This kind of policy has two main characteristics. First, it aims at addressing the different demands of cultural groups. That is, it is a kind of policy that refers to the different normative challenges (ethnic conflict, internal illiberalism, federal autonomy, and so forth) that arise as a result of cultural diversity. For example, these are policies that aim at addressing the different normative challenges that arise from minority groups, like Quebecois, wishing to have their own institutions in a different language from the rest of Canada. To contrast with redistributive policies, multicultural policies are not primarily about distributive justice, that is, who gets what share of resources, although multicultural policies may refer to redistribution accidentally (Fraser, 2001). Multicultural policies aim at correcting the kind of disadvantages that some individuals are victims of, and that result from these individuals’ cultural identity. For instance, these are policies that aim at correcting a disadvantage that may result from someone being a member of a certain religion. In the case of some Muslims, this can mean addressing the problem of Muslims living in a Christian country and demanding different public holidays than the majority to celebrate their own festivals such as Eid-al-Fitr.

Second, multicultural policies are policies that aim at providing groups the means by which individuals can pursue their cultural differences. Put differently, multicultural policies have as their objectives, the preservation, allowance or celebration of differences between different groups. Consequently, multicultural policies contrast with assimilation. That is, according to the assimilationist view, it is acceptable that people are different, but the final goal of policies should be to make the minority group become part of the majority group, that is, to be accepted by those in the majority group, and to somehow find a consensus position between different cultures. Contrastingly, multiculturalism acknowledges that people have different ways of life and, in general terms, the state ought not to assimilate these groups but to give them the tools for pursuing their own ways of life or culture. That is, from a multiculturalist point of view, the final objective of policies is neither the standardization of cultural forms nor any form of uniformity or homogeneity; rather, its objective is to allow and give the means for groups to pursue their differences.

According to Kymlicka, in the context of contemporary liberal political philosophy, there have been two waves of writings on multiculturalism (Kymlicka, 1999a). This discussion of what policies ought to be undertaken in order to protect minority cultures is included in what Kymlicka called the first wave of the wave of writings on multiculturalism. In his view (1999a, p. 112), the first wave of writing focused on assessing to what extent it is just, from a liberal point of view, to give rights to groups so that they can pursue their cultural differences. In this first wave of writings, contemporary liberal political philosophers have discussed what kind of inequalities exist between majorities and minorities, and how these should be addressed. In other words, the discussion has been about what kind of intergroup inequalities exist, and what the state should do about them. In general terms, contemporary liberal political philosophers who have written about this topic have taken two different stands. On the one hand, some liberal political philosophers defend that state institutions should be blind to difference and that individuals should be given a uniform set of rights and liberties. In these authors’ views, cultural diversity, religious freedom and so forth are sufficiently protected by these sets of rights and liberties, especially by freedom of association and conscience. Therefore, those who stand for a uniform set of rights and liberties contend that ascribing rights on the basis of membership in a group is a discriminatory and immoral policy that creates citizenship hierarchies that are undesirable and unjust (Kymlicka, 1999a, pp. 112-113). Thus, in the view of these contemporary liberal philosophers, involvement in the cultural character of society is something that the state is under the duty to not do.

On the other hand, some philosophers have taken the opposite view on this matter. For example, there are some contemporary liberal political philosophers who are more sympathetic to the idea of ascribing rights to groups and have defended difference-sensitive policies. As Kymlicka (1999a, p. 112) points out, these contemporary liberal political philosophers have tried to show that difference-sensitive rules are not inherently unjust. In general terms, these contemporary political philosophers argue that a regime of difference-sensitive policies does not necessarily entail a hierarchization of citizenship and unfair privileges for some groups. Rather, they argue that difference-sensitive policies aim at correcting intergroup inequalities and disadvantages in the cultural market. Moreover, some of these philosophers contend that difference-blind policies favor the needs, interests and identities of the majority (Kymlicka, 1999a, pp. 112-114). These philosophers who consider that groups are entitled to special rights can be classified as a form of multicultural citizenship.

Those who defend special rights for groups have suggested a variety of policies. In his book The Multiculturalism of Fear, Levy (2000, pp. 125-160) systematically exposed the kinds of difference-sensitive policies that are usually discussed in the literature. According to him, difference-sensitive policies can be divided into eight categories: exemptions, assistance, symbolic claims, recognition/enforcement, special representation, self-government, external rules and internal rules.

Exemptions to laws are usually rights based on a negative liberty of non-interference from the state in a specific affair, which would cause a significant burden to a certain group. Or, to put it another way, exemptions to the law happen when the state abstains from interfering with or obliging a certain group who desire to practice something in order to diminish their burden. Exemptions can also be a limitation of someone else’s liberty to impose some costs on a certain group. Imagine that there is a general law that decrees corporations have the right to impose a dress code upon their employees. However, having this general law would burden those groups for whom dressing in a certain manner (that is, different from the one required by the company) is a very important value. For example, for many Sikh men and Muslim women it is very important to wear turbans and headscarves, respectively. Hence, it can be claimed that giving these individuals the option of either finding another job or rejecting their dress code can be a significant burden to them; given that the choice of dressing in a certain way is sometimes much harder for Sikh men and Muslim women than for a Westerner, and that it would undermine their identity, an exemption may be justified (Levy, 2000, pp. 128-133). Hence, these groups would be able to engage in practices that are not allowable for the majority of citizens.

Assistance rights aim to aid individuals in overcoming the obstacles they face because they belong to a certain group. In other words, assistance rights aim to rectify disadvantages experienced by certain individuals, as a result of their membership of a certain group, when compared to the majority. This can mean funding individuals to pursue their goals or using positive discrimination to help them in a variety of ways. Language rights are an example of this approach. Suppose that some individuals from Catalonia cannot speak Spanish. An assistance measure would be having people speak both Spanish and Catalan at public institutions, so that they can serve people from the minority as well the minority language group. Another example would be awarding subsidies to help groups preserve their cohesion by maintaining their practices and beliefs, and by allowing individuals from a minority to participate in public institutions as full citizens. Most of these practices are temporary, but they do not need to be (language rights, for example, are often not temporary) (Levy, 2000, pp. 133-137).

Symbolic claims refer to problems which do not affect individuals’ lives directly or seriously, but which may make the relations between individuals from different groups better. In a multicultural country, where there are multiple religions, ethnicities and ways of life, it may not make sense to have certain symbols that represent only a specific culture. Symbolic claims are ones that require, on the grounds of equality, the inclusion of all the cultures in a specific country in that country’s symbols. An example would be including Catholic, Sikh, Muslim, Protestant, Welsh, Northern Irish, Scottish, and English symbols on both the British flag and in the national anthem. Not integrating minority symbols may be considered as dispensing a lack of respect and unequal treatment to minorities.

Recognition is a demand for integrating a specific law or cultural practice into the larger society. If individuals want to integrate a specific law, they can ask for the law to become part of the major legal system. Hence, Sharia law could form part of divorce law for Muslims, while Aboriginal law could run in conjunction with Australian property rights law. It could also be a requirement to include certain groups in the history books used in schools–for example, to include the history of Indian and Pakistani immigrants in British history textbooks. Failing to integrate this law may bring a substantive burden to bear on individuals’ identity. In the Muslim case, because family law is of crucial importance to their identity, they may be considerably burdened by having to abide by a Western perspective of divorce. With regards to Aboriginal law, because hunting is essential for their way of life, if other individuals own the(ir) land this may undermine the Aboriginal culture.

Special representation rights are designed to protect groups which have been systematically unrepresented and disadvantaged in the larger society. Minority groups may be under-represented in the institutions of a society, and in order to place them in a position of equal bargaining power, it is necessary to provide special rights to the members of these groups. Hence, these rights aim to defend individuals’ interests in a more equal manner by guaranteeing some privileges or preventing discrimination. One way to achieve this is by setting aside extra seats for minorities in parliament (Kymlicka, 1995, pp. 131-152; Levy, 2000, pp. 150-154).

Self-government rights are usually what are claimed by national minorities (for example, Pueblo Indians and Quebecois) and they usually demand some degree of autonomy and self-determination. This sometimes implies demands for exclusive occupation of land and territorial jurisdiction. The reason groups sometimes may need these rights is that the kind of autonomy they give is a necessary condition by which individuals can develop their cultures, which is in the best interest of a culture’s members. More precisely, a specific educational curriculum, language right or jurisdiction over a territory may be a necessary requirement for the survival and prosperity of a particular culture and its members. This is compatible with both freedom and equality; it is compatible with freedom because it allows individuals access to their culture and to make their own choices; it is consistent with equality because it places individuals on an equal footing in terms of cultural access (Kymlicka, 1995, pp. 27-30; Levy, 2000, pp. 137- 138).

What Levy classifies as external rules can be considered as kinds of rights for self-government. They involve restricting other people’s freedom in order to preserve a certain culture. Hence, Aborigines in Australia employ external safeguards to protect their land. For example, freedom of movement is limited to outsiders who circulate in Aboriginal territory; furthermore, outsiders do not have the right to buy Aboriginal land. Demands that groups make for internal rules are those demands that aim at restricting individuals’ behavior within the group. Stigmatizing, ostracizing or excommunicating individuals from groups because they have not abided by the rules is what is usually meant by internal rules. Thus, this is the power given to groups to treat their members in a way that is not acceptable for the rest of society. An example can be if a certain individual marries someone from another group, which may then mean he is expelled from his own group. Another case is that of the Amish who want their children to withdraw from school earlier than the rest of society. In contrast to external rules, the restrictions on freedom apply to members of the group and not to outsiders. It is controversial whether internal rules are compatible with liberal values or not. On the one hand, authors like Kymlicka affirm they are not, because they undermine individuals’ autonomy, which is, in his view, a central liberal value. On the other hand, philosophers like Kukathas contend that liberals are committed to tolerance and, thereby, should accept some internal restrictions.

i. Multicultural Citizenship

Generally speaking, the philosophy of those authors who defend a multicultural citizenship, have five points in common. Firstly, they all contend that the state has the duty to support laws which defend the basic legal, civil and political rights of its citizens. Secondly, they argue that the state should participate in the construction of societal cultural character, thus its laws and policies should aim to protect culture. Thirdly, these philosophers contend that the character of culture is normative. Consequently, and this is the fourth common feature, individuals’ interest in culture is sufficiently strong enough that it needs to be supported by the state. Fifth, they both defend difference-sensitive/multicultural citizenship policies for protecting culture. Some of the philosophers who defend a multicultural citizenship are Taylor, Kymlicka and Shachar.

1. Taylor's Politics of Recognition

According to Taylor, there are two forms of recognition; intimate recognition and public recognition. Taylor (1994b, p. 37) mainly discusses the idea of public recognition or recognition in the public sphere. This form of recognition is about respect and esteem for one’s identity in the public realm; being misrecognized in the public realm means to have one’s identity disrespected in a way whereby one is treated as a second-class citizen. Being misrecognized, in this sense, is to have an unequal citizenship status in virtue of one’s identity. Hence, someone is misrecognized in the public sphere if one has a legal disadvantage that results from one’s identity. To have respect and esteem for someone in the public sphere means to have citizenship rights that do not disadvantage one’s identity. In Taylor’s view, misrecognition can potentially be a form of oppression and helps to create self-hating images in those who are misrecognized. Bearing this in mind, recognition is a vital human need because the relation between recognition and identity (the way people understand who they are) is relatively strong; hence, misrecognition or non-recognition may have a serious harmful effect on individuals

In order to discuss the best way to achieve recognition in the public realm, Taylor draws a distinction between procedural and non-procedural forms of liberalism. He affirms that, according to the procedural version of liberalism, a just society is one where all individuals have a uniform set of rights and freedoms, and having different rights for different people creates distinctions between first-class and second-class citizens: this liberalism is only committed to individual rights and rejects the idea of collective rights. The state, according to this version of liberalism, should not be involved in the cultural character of society and the procedures of this society must be independent of any particular set of values held by the citizens of that polity. In other words, the state should be neutral and independent of any conception of the good life.

In Taylor’s (1994b, p. 60) view, procedural liberalism is inhospitable to difference and is unable to accommodate different cultures. Taylor believes that, in some cases, collective goals need to be aided so that they can be achieved. Sometimes cultural communities need to have power over certain jurisdictions so that they can promote their own culture; this is something that a procedural liberalism does not offer, according to Taylor. Due to the fact that Taylor considers recognition as important, this kind of liberalism that is inhospitable to difference should be rejected; rather, in Taylor’s view, a non-procedural liberalism that is involved in the cultural character of society in a way that enhances cultural diversity and is not hostile to difference is the kind of liberalism that should be endorsed. From Taylor’s point of view, this non-procedural liberalism is not neutral between different ways of life and it is grounded in judgments of what the good life is. According to Taylor, this liberalism takes into account differences between individuals and groups and by taking these into account it creates an environment that is not hostile to the flourishing of different cultures. Engaging in policies that promote culture is, in Taylor’s view, extremely important; cultural communities deserve protection owing to the fact that they provide members with the basis of their identities. The language of cultures provides the framework for the question of who one is. Taylor believes that identity is strongly influenced by culture; therefore, there is a moral and social framework given by the language of one’s culture that individuals need in order to make sense of their lives. Therefore, recognition and protection of individuals’ cultural communities is required for respecting and preserving one’s identity. However, in Taylor’s view, this commitment to promoting difference is acceptable only if the measures taken to promote difference are constant with what he considers to be fundamental rights. Taylor specifically mentions the rights to life, liberty, due process, free speech and free practice of religion.

From Taylor’s point of view, this non-procedural liberalism has implications for public policy. It means that there should be decentralized power so that communities can flourish. However, what this decentralization and non-procedural liberalism imply in practice depends on the context; in different countries with different kinds of minorities there may be different implications. Taylor mostly writes about the Canadian context and he believes that in this context the best policy is a form of federalism. In his view, Quebec should be given self-government rights so that it has power over a certain number of policies. In particular, Taylor affirms that it should have sovereign power over art, technology, economy, labor, communications, agriculture, and fisheries. In the case of language policies, Taylor contends that in some cases it is justified to violate liberal values, like freedom of expression, in order to protect the language of a community. For instance, in the case of Quebec, communications in English can be restricted by the state in order to promote the French language.  Another example is that offspring of French parents do not have the option of choosing a language of instruction that is not French. Moreover, it should have shared power with the majority in immigration, industrial policy and environmental policy. Control over defense, external affairs and currency is given to the federal government. It is important to emphasize that, in Taylor’s view, federalism is not a necessary implication of non-procedural liberalism. Federalism is not at the core of the recognition idea; rather, federalism is a kind of system that Taylor considers is the adequate option in the Canadian context, which does not mean it is a good option in all contexts.

2. Kymlicka's Multicultural Liberalism

Kymlicka believes that group rights are compatible and promote the liberal values of freedom and equality. As a result, Kymlicka offers arguments that relate freedom and equality with group rights. The argument based on freedom is strongly related to his idea of societal culture. In Kymlicka’s perspective (1995, p. 80), societal cultures promote freedom. From Kymlicka’s point of view, the reason why societal cultures are important for freedom is because they give individuals the groundwork from which they can make choices. In particular, according to Kymlicka, because societal cultures provide a framework with meaningful ways of life, then they provide the social conditions that are necessary for individuals to make autonomous choices. Autonomy, in turn, is only possible if and only if these social conditions are the ones of individuals’ societal cultures.

Taking this on board, Kymlicka’s argument is that societal cultures ought to be protected because they promote the liberal value of autonomy; they promote this value because societal cultures give, in Kymlicka’s perspective, a context of choice that is necessary for individuals to exercise their freedom. Put differently, from Kymlicka’s point of view, individuals’ own cultures provide the groundwork that individuals need in order to make free choices. Consequently, if liberals are committed to this value, they are committed to protecting the conditions (societal cultures) to achieve it. This means that if group rights are necessary for protecting this context of choice, then they are justified from a liberal point of view; for if group rights can protect the context of choice, then they are promoting autonomy. As mentioned above, from the three sources of diversity only national minorities have societal cultures. Hence, this argument only justifies group rights for national minorities in order to protect their societal cultures. In Kymlicka’s view, the context of choice is given by the access to one’s own culture, not just to any culture. So according to this view, for someone from Quebec, the societal culture of Catalonia does not provide a context of choice; likewise, for someone from an Amish community, the societal culture of Sikhs in India does not provide this Amish individual with a context of choice.

The three arguments based on equality that Kymlicka offers for defending group rights rely on a different line of reasoning. The first argument starts by observing that there is an inevitable involvement in the cultural character of society by the state and it is impossible to be completely neutral. Kymlicka affirms that the decisions made by governments, like what public holidays to have, unavoidably promote a certain cultural identity. Consequently, those individuals who do not share the culture promoted by the state are disadvantaged. In other words, they are in an unequal position. More precisely, by observing the unequal treatment that results from the inevitable involvement in the cultural character of society by the state, Kymlicka contends that uniform laws giving the same rights to all individuals from different cultures treat individuals unequally. To take the example of public holidays, the establishment of Christian public holidays disadvantages Muslims because their main festival, Eid-al-Fitr, occurs at a time of the year when there are no public holidays. Bearing this in mind, Kymlicka argues that if liberals are committed to equality, then they should endorse a kind of public policy that does not advantage some individuals over others; this, in turn, means that in order to equalize the status of different groups, the state ought to entitle different groups to different rights.

In Kymlicka’s view, group rights can correct these inequalities by providing the necessary and sufficient means by which individuals can pursue their culture. Although the argument for autonomy only applies to national minorities, this argument based on equality refers to national minorities and polyethnic groups. Inequalities between majorities and national minorities can take many shapes, but an example that Kymlicka likes to use is language rights inequalities. From his point of view, national linguistic minorities like those of Quebec and Catalonia would be treated unequally if they did not have the right to have their own institutions in their national language. The debate about Christian and Muslim holidays is an example of inequalities between majorities and polyethnic groups. Taking this on board, it is Kymlicka’s (1995) conviction that the two kinds of diversity can potentially be treated unequally by a set of uniform laws. As a result, any of these three kinds of diversity are entitled to group rights on grounds of promoting equality between groups within a liberal state.

Kymlicka’s second argument based on equality is that if it is the case that all individuals in society should have it, then the state is committed to promote a variety of cultures so that individuals have more options relating to choice. This argument, however, is not directed at minorities but rather at majorities, and it does not refer to a need of the minority; instead, it refers to how culture can make individuals’ lives better in general, by providing more options. Furthermore, Kymlicka (1995, p. 121) considers that because it is difficult to change one’s culture, this would not be a very attractive choice for everyone.

The third argument is that, according to Kymlicka, liberals should respect historical agreements. In Kymlicka’s view, many of the rights that minority cultures have in the early 21st century are the result of historical agreements. If the state is to treat individuals from different cultures with equal respect, then it should respect these agreements.

3. Shachar's Transformative Accommodation

Shachar is another philosopher who has defended a kind of multicultural citizenship. Shachar endorses a joint governance model that she calls transformative accommodation. According to Shachar, this model relies on four assumptions. First, individuals have a multiplicity of identities. For example, Malcolm X was a Muslim, a male, an African-American, and a heterosexual. Hence, individuals have a multiplicity of affiliations that play a role in their identities. The second assumption is that both the group and the state have normative and legal reasons to shape behavior. There may be a variety of reasons for this, but at least one of them is that individuals have a strong interest both in preserving their cultures and protecting their individual rights. Third, both what the state and the group do impact on each other. For instance, the laws that the state makes about same-sex marriage has an impact on heterosexist minority groups; the heterosexism of minority groups, like the hate speech of the Westboro Baptist Church, also impacts on the state. Fourth, both the state and the group have an interest in supporting their members (Shachar, 2001a, p. 118).

On top of these four assumptions, transformative accommodation is based on three core principles; sub-matter allocation of authority, no monopoly, and the clear establishment of delineated options (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 118-119). According to the sub-matters allocation of authority principle, the holistic view that contested social arenas (family law, criminal law, employment law and so forth) are indivisible is incorrect. According to this principle, these social arenas can be divisible into sub-matters, that is, into multiple separable components that are complementary (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 51-54). In practice, this means that norms and decisions about disputed social matters can be determined separately. In other words, in each area of law, there are sub-areas and these sub-areas are partially independent; as a result, a decision made in a sub-area can be made independently of a decision made in another sub-area. In Shachar’s view, family law, for example, can be divided into demarcating and distributive sub-matters or sub-areas. In her (2001a, pp. 119-120) view, the demarcating sub-matter of family law is where group membership boundaries are defined. That is, it is in this sub-matter that the necessary and sufficient attributes (biological, ethnical, territorial, ideological and so forth) for membership are decided. The distributive sub-matter refers to the distribution of resources. For instance, it would be in the demarcating sub-matter where it would be decided who gets what after divorce.

To illustrate how this principle would work in practice, Shachar routinely uses a legal dispute that occurred with a Native-American tribe and one of their members. This is the case of Julia Martinez; Julia Martinez, was a member of the Santa Clara Pueblo tribe whose daughter’s membership of the group was rejected, a rejection leading to tragic consequences. In 1941, Julia Martinez, who was a daughter of members of the Santa Clara Pueblo tribe married a man from outside the group. With this man, she had a daughter, who was raised in the Pueblo reservation, subsequently participating in and learning the norms and practices of the tribe. However, according to this tribe’s law, only the offspring of male members are considered members; hence, although Julia Martinez’ daughter was raised on the reservation, she was not, in the eyes of the tribe leaders, a tribe member. When Julia Martinez’s daughter got ill, she had to go to the emergency section of the Indian Health Services. Nevertheless, she was refused emergency treatment on grounds of not being a member of the tribe; a refusal that later caused her death (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 18-20). According to the sub-matters principle, in the case of the Santa Clara Pueblo tribe, it would be the legislators in the demarcation sub-matter who would determine whether Julia Martinez’s daughter was a member of the tribe or not (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 52-54). Contrastingly, it would be in the distributive sub-matter would that her entitlement or not to use the Indian Health Services would be decided.

By establishing the second principle, the no monopoly rule, Shachar defends that jurisdictional powers should be divided between the state and the group. According to this principle, neither the state nor the group should hold absolute power over the contested social arenas. More precisely, the group should hold power over one sub-matter while the state should hold power over another. Consequently, legal decisions would result from an interdependent and cooperative relationship between the group and the state (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 120-122). In the case of family law, if there is a divorce dispute, the state could take control of distribution (for example, property division after divorce) and the group, demarcation (for example, who can request divorce and why) or vice-versa.

The third principle defended by Shachar is the definition of clearly delineated options. According to this principle, individuals should have clear options between choosing to abide by the state or the group jurisdiction. In particular, this means that individuals can either decide to abide by a jurisdiction or they can refuse to abide by it and exit that jurisdiction at predefined reversal points. These predefined reversal points are an agreement made between the state and the group, where it is decided when individuals can exit the group and in what circumstances.

ii. Negative Universalism

The other approach to the philosophical discussion about justice between groups can be called negative universalism (Festenstein, 2005). Two philosophers who endorse this approach are, according to Festenstein (2005), Barry and Kukathas. Despite the fact that the philosophies of Barry and Kukathas are different, as negative universalists, they have four features in common.

Firstly, both defend the neutrality of the state among different conceptions of the good. That is, individuals should be free to pursue their own conceptions of the good. Secondly, this impartiality does not have the same impact on all citizens’ lives, that is, some will be better-off than others. Nevertheless, this is not, according to these philosophers, a counter-argument against the liberal value of neutrality, because equality of impact is not a realistic goal. Thirdly, principles of liberal theory adopt ‘basic civil and political rights’ with differentiations that may be justified through fundamental basic rights such as freedom of thought and association. However, basic civil and political rights and justified deviations differ substantially when both are permitted simultaneously. Fourth, negative universalists are skeptical concerning the normative value of culture and about providing differentiated rights to individuals (Festenstein, 2005, pp. 91-92).

1. Barry's Liberal Egalitarianism

Barry’s view is that liberal egalitarianism is the philosophical doctrine that offers the most coherent and just approach to protect these interests. In addition, from his viewpoint, liberal egalitarianism offers the normative groundwork for the challenges that illiberal and heterosexist cultural groups raise. His liberal egalitarian approach, in particular, has as core values neutrality, freedom and equality.

According to Barry, neutrality means that states are under the duty of not promoting or favoring some conceptions of the good over others. In general terms, this means that state policy should not promote the survival and flourishing of a conception of the good, a language, a religion and so forth. Rather, neutrality requires that states be committed to individual rights without any sort of collective goal, besides those that correspond to universal basic interests. When the state favors a specific conception of the good by assisting it, it is violating neutrality (Barry, 2001, pp. 28, 29, 122). In Barry’s version of liberal neutrality, conceptions of the good are a private extra-political matter, which refer to personal affairs (Barry, 1995, p. 118). Hence, non-secular states, like Iran or Saudi Arabia, violate neutrality in Barry’s sense because they promote a specific religion.

The other important value for Barry, freedom, means not having paternalistic restrictions on pursuing one’s own conception of the good. This implies that individuals should be provided with a considerable amount of independence to pursue their own conceptions of the good. According to Barry, all individuals should be given the means for this pursuit. In practice, this means that all individuals are entitled to freedoms that enable them to pursue their own conceptions of the good and lifestyles; in particular, Barry considers that freedom of association and conscience play a fundamental role in enabling individuals in this pursuit. Individuals may choose to live a lifestyle that liberals may disapprove of; however, Barry (2001, p. 161) considers that bad choices are something that individuals in a liberal society are entitled to make.

Barry’s third commitment, the one to equality, translates into two core ideas. First, treating people equally means to furnish individuals with an equal set of basic legal, political and civil rights. That is, equality requires endorsing a unitary conception of citizenship. Second, the commitment to equality entails that the state has the duty to promote equality of opportunity. For Barry, there is an equal opportunity when uniform rules generate the same set of choices to all individuals (Barry, 2005). This means that there is equality of opportunity if and only if, in a specific situation, different individuals have the capacity to make the choice that is needed to achieve their aims. For example, imagine that Sam and John want both to be medical doctors; imagine that Sam is from a working class family and John from an upper class family. Sam does not have the economic resources to study, but John has. In such a situation, assuming that the economic factor is the only relevant factor for equalizing choice, in order to achieve equality of opportunity, Sam should be given a similar amount of economic resources to John, so that he has the same capacity to make the choice of a career in medicine. Therefore, equality of opportunity requires that individuals be treated according to their needs. Barry also argues that equality of opportunity entails that the is under the duty of equalizing choice sets, not equalizing the outcomes that result from the decisions people make in those choice sets.

Taking this normative groundwork on board, Barry offers six arguments against giving rights to cultural groups. Four of these are a result of his liberal theory; the other two are independent arguments not related to his theory.

The first argument against difference-sensitive policies for cultural groups presented by Barry is that this would be a violation of neutrality. For Barry, neutrality requires that there is no or little involvement in the cultural character of society; hence, if the state privileged a group either by promoting this group’s culture or by empowering the group with different rights from other groups, then the state would be violating neutrality. Barry believes that liberals are committed to non-interference in the cultural character of society; as a result, liberalism is incompatible with difference-sensitive policies. In practice, what this implies for multicultural demands is that any kind of exemption, recognition, assistance or any other kind of group right should be denied on the grounds of neutrality. For example, in Barry’s view, if a certain state does not criminalize homosexuality and the governing body of a minority religious group asks recognition of its religious courts that convict its gay members for same-sex acts, the state should not concede this recognition because doing so would be giving a different right to a different group and, therefore, it would be a violation of neutrality.

The second argument provided by Barry against group rights is that the unequal impact of policies on cultures is not an interference with freedom to pursue one’s own conception of the good. In Barry’s view, laws have the aim of protecting some interests against others; the fact that they have a different impact on a specific culture is not a sign of unfairness; rather, it is just a side effect of having laws (Barry, 2001, p. 34).

Third, in Barry’s view, the only group rights conceded, especially those exemptions to the law, are cultural practices that overlap with universal human interests. In other words, if the group right and, in particular the exemption to the law, promotes a universal human interest, then it is acceptable (Barry, 2001, pp. 48-50). For instance, Muslim girls cannot be refused education on the grounds of a minor issue such as dress codes, because education is a universal human interest.

Fourth, Barry contends that because neither culture nor cultural demands are a universal interest per se, then the unequal treatment that is acceptable for universal interests does not apply to these (Barry, 2001, pp. 12-13, 16). To recall, Barry’s conception of equality of opportunity entails that individuals can be treated unequally so that their choice sets are equalized. However, Barry affirms that these choice sets should be equalized only if these are choice sets about universal interests, which culture is not. In short, exemptions can and should be guaranteed for universal or higher-order interests but not for particular interests.

These four arguments are dependent on Barry’s liberal theory; they depend on his conception of freedom, neutrality and equality. To these arguments, he adds two ad hoc arguments. First, that difference-sensitive rights that aim to protect economic resources are temporary, while cultural rights are permanent. This means that those who need economic resources to equalize their choice sets only need this aid temporarily (Barry, 2001, pp. 12-13). Contrastingly, according to Barry, group rights to protect culture are required permanently. Like the case of the Sikh, a permanent law that exempted Sikhs from wearing helmets would be necessary. The other ad hoc argument is that when there is a reasonable argument it should be applied without exception. If there is a case for exception, then the rule should be abandoned. According to him, it is philosophically incoherent to provide a universal justification for a rule and then relativize the reason just given (Barry, 2001, pp. 32-50).

2. Kukathas' Libertarianism

Kukathas’ approach to multiculturalism is, broadly speaking, based on two ideas: these ideas are what he considers to be human beings’ most fundamental interest and his theory of freedom of association. Kukathas considers that human beings have only one fundamental interest: the interest in living according to their conscience. In his opinion, the reason for this is, in part, that human beings are primarily moral beings and, consequently, are disposed to direct their lives/purposes towards what they consider to be morally worthwhile. Consequently, from Kukathas’ point of view, individuals find it difficult to act against their conscience. This tendency to govern one’s own conduct primarily by conscience and the difficulty to act against one’s moral beliefs can, in Kukathas’ (2003b, p. 53) view, be observed and has empirical support. An additional reason why acting according to one’s own conscience is a fundamental interest is because, according to Kukathas, the meaning of life is given by conscience (Kukathas, 2003b, p. 55). Hence, Kukathas considers that identity is connected with morality because what individuals are is their self-interpretation, which ultimately is provided by moral evaluation. It is important to notice that this says nothing about what each person’s morality is. A human rights activist and a terrorist can be both acting according to their conscience even if they are doing opposite things. Owing to the fact that conscience is a fundamental interest, Kukathas contends that the state is under the duty to protect this interest.

The second important aspect of Kukathas’ philosophy is his defense of freedom of association. According to Kukathas, freedom of association is primarily defined as the right to exit groups, that is, freedom of association exists when individuals have the freedom to leave or dissociate from a group they are part of. In other words, essential to this version of freedom of association is the idea that individuals should not be forced to remain members of communities they do not wish to associate with. Therefore, according to this definition, freedom of association is not about the freedom of entering a specific group; rather, it is about the freedom to leave those groups that individuals want to dissociate from (Kukathas, 2003b, p. 95).

According to Kukathas, there are two necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for individuals to have the freedom to exit. These conditions are that individuals are not physically barred from leaving, and that there is a place similar to a market society where they can exit. From Kukathas’ point of view, a place to go is a necessary requirement for exit because it would not be credible to think that individuals had a right to exit if all communities were organized on a basis of kinship, for the options available would be either conformity to the rules or loneliness.

According to this theory of freedom, the functions of the state are quite limited. In Kukathas’ style of freedom of association, the state is not duty bound to secure individuals’ access to healthcare, education, and so forth. These forms of welfare should be provided by associations, if those associations wish to provide them. According to Kukathas’ theory, the state should only intervene to guarantee the right to exit, preserving the ongoing order of society by guaranteeing the safety and security of its citizens and preventing civil war. In practice, this means that the state has two functions. First, the state has to guarantee that there is no violation of freedom of association, that is, that individuals within associations are not being forced to remain members by being physically barred from leaving. Second, it means that the state should regulate so that there is no aggression between associations. So, even though associations can endorse practices that are extremely aggressive towards their members, it is a requirement for Kukathas that there is mutual toleration between associations. Societies cannot commit acts of aggression towards each other and, if they do, the state can, in his view, legitimately intervene to stop this aggression.

Bearing in mind the functions of the state and the internal structure of associations, this society would be a society of societies. Each society or group would have its own legislation, that is, they would have jurisdictional independence (Kukathas, 2003b, p. 97). In Kukathas’ view, the validity of the laws of communities only have local recognition, that is, the state would not recognize same-sex marriage and so forth; rather the state would be indifferent to the way individuals associate.

From Kukathas’ point of view, this version of freedom of association is compatible with the imposition of high costs of exit/dissociation and membership due to the fact that the magnitude of costs in a choice are not related to freedom (Kukathas, 2003b, pp. 107-109). In his view, this model of freedom of association is the best way to protect individuals’ freedom of conscience because it gives few restrictions to what individuals can do and consequently allows a wide variety of practices. For instance, an ethnic community where the members, generally speaking, believe that female genital mutilation is an important practice and that it is immoral not to engage in this practice, would be, in Kukathas’ view, better off if they had the possibility to form their own association where the practice would be accepted, then if they were part of a larger community with regulations against such practice.

3. The Second Wave of Writings on Multiculturalism

Taking this on board, in this first wave of writings on multiculturalism, the debate has centered on discussing the justice of difference-sensitive policies in the liberal context. On the whole, there are two difference positions taken by contemporary liberal political philosophers who have written on multiculturalism; some defend that difference-sensitive policies are justified, whereas others argue that they are a deviation from the core values of liberalism.

More recently, a second wave of writings on multiculturalism has appeared. In this, contemporary liberal political philosophers have not focused so much on debates about justice between different groups; rather, they have focused on justice within groups. Thus, the debate has changed to the analysis of the potentially perverse effects of policies to protect minority cultural groups with regard to the members of these minority cultural groups. Contemporary liberal political philosophers have now switched to discussing the practical implications that those that aimed at correcting inter-group equality could have for the members of those groups that the policies are directed to. In particular, the worry is that the policies for enabling members of minority groups to pursue their culture could favor some members of minority groups over others. That is, this new debate is about the risks that those policies for protecting cultural groups could have in undermining the status of the weaker members of these groups. The reason why philosophers worry about this is because the policies for multiculturalism may give the leaders of cultural groups’ power for making decisions and institutionalizing practices that facilitate the persecution of internal minorities. In other words, those policies may give group leaders all kinds of power that reinforce or facilitate cruelty and discrimination within the group (Phillips, 2007a, pp. 13-14; Reich, 2005, pp. 209-210; Shachar, 2001a, pp. 3, 4, 15-16).

Three kinds of internal minorities have received special attention from contemporary political philosophers: these are bisexuals, gays and lesbians, women and children.

a. Gays, Lesbians and Bisexuals

Some philosophers are concerned about how policies meant to protect minority cultural groups can potentially impose serious threats and harm the interests and rights of lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals. In some minority cultural groups, lesbian gay and bisexuals within minorities are very disadvantaged by the unintended consequences of multicultural politics (Levy, 2005; Swaine, 2005, pp. 44-45). Heterosexism is a cross-cutting issue in minority cultural groups (and society in general), covering diverse areas of life, ranging from basic freedoms and rights, employment, education, family life, economic and welfare rights, sexual freedom, physical and psychological integrity, safety, and so forth. In general terms, it can be affirmed that lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals have an interest in bodily and psychological integrity, sexual freedom, participation in cultural and political life, family life, basic civil and political rights, economic and employment equality and access to welfare provision.

Sometimes, lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals have their freedom of association, opinion, expression, assembly, and thought limited (European Union Agency for Fundamental Rights, 2009, pp. 50-55). Minority cultural groups can jeopardize these interests due to hierarchies of power within groups. Some groups use a variety of norms of social control. Also in some groups, participation in political decisions and freedom of expression is culturally determined.

In some minority cultural groups, lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals’ interest in being free from murder, torture, and other cruel, inhuman and degrading treatment is also sometimes violated (European Union Agency for Fundamental Rights, 2009, pp. 13-16). Many lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals are victims of physical and psychological harassment, murder, hate speech, hate crimes, brutal sexual conversion therapies, and corrective rape, among other kinds of physical and psychological violence.

Some minority cultural groups also sometimes undermine lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals’ interests in economic and welfare rights. In the case of employment, this refers to anti-discrimination law in the workplace and in admission for jobs. In some cases, lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals’ freedom and the right to join the armed forces, to work with children, to employment benefits and health insurance for same-sex families are denied. Although not many religious groups have armed forces, this example could apply to the Swiss Army that protects the Vatican.

Bearing this in mind, some contemporary political philosophers have discussed to what extent giving special rights to groups can potentially facilitate the imposition of such unequal and cruel practices.

b. Women

Some philosophers, especially liberal feminist philosophers, have raised concerns about the implications of providing special rights to groups for women. Okin has contended that most cultures in the world are patriarchal and gendered and, consequently, providing rights to groups may help with reinforcing oppressive gendered and patriarchal practices. Some of the practices that may jeopardize women’s rights are female genital mutilation, polygamy, the use of headscarves, and a lesser valuation of the career and education of women.

Female genital mutilation, a practice that some communities engage in, is considered by some feminists to be a cruel practice that undermines the sexual health of women and aims at controlling their bodies. Polygamy is a practice that some communities follow, with some feminists contending that this practice is deeply disrespectful to women, and a clear way of treating women unequally. The use of headscarves is considered by some feminists to be a way of controlling women’s bodies and showing submission to males. Taking this on board, the concern expressed by some feminists is that empowering groups with special rights may reinforce female oppression. For example, if some communities are exempt from the health practices of the majority of society, this may help them to perpetuate and spread the practice of female genital mutilation.

Nevertheless, it is important to emphasize that the view that cultures are necessarily patriarchal, gendered and oppressive for women is not a unanimous position among feminists. Indeed, Volpp (2001) and Phillips (2007a), for instance, have defended the position that many feminists take an ethnocentric point of view when analyzing minority practices and misunderstand the true meaning of practices. Furthermore, Volpp and Phillips contend that many women in minority cultures are agents capable of making their own choices; therefore some of those practices that can be considered oppressive from a Western point of view should not be banned.

c. Children

The implications of special rights to children who are members of minority cultures is also a topic that has received some attention from contemporary political philosophers (Reich, 2005). The concerns with respect to children are especially with regards to physical and psychological abuse and lack of education. With respect to physical and psychological abuse, some groups may have practices that are harmful for children. For example, some groups practice shunning, a practice that consists of ostracizing those who do not follow their norms or who have done something that is disapproved of by the community. The traditional scarification of children that some African communities practice is also a practice that may be considered to entail physical abuse. With respect to education, there are groups who wish to take their children out of school at an earlier age. Some may argue that removing children from school earlier than their peers may strongly disadvantage these children because they will potentially not acquire the minimum skills necessary to find a job, and will not receive enough education to make autonomous choices. Other groups consider that education should be mainly about the study of the religious scripture, and they sometimes disregard other kinds of education.

Owing to the fact that schools are a central vehicle of autonomy and cultural transmission and because children are at a formative age and, thereby, much more likely to be influenced by the way they are brought up, some political philosophers have shown concern about the impact of giving special rights to groups that may treat children inappropriately, indoctrinate them, and maybe disadvantage them when compared with children who are not members of those groups.

It is important to emphasize, however, that this is not to say that providing special rights to minority groups entails that children, women and gays, lesbians and bisexuals will be disadvantaged. Many postcolonial philosophers, like Mookherjee (2005), have contended that even though there may be worries about internal oppression, sometimes these worries are misplaced. Routinely, members of minority cultures see value in their cultural practices and wish to endorse them, despite the fact that these practices may look oppressive for outsiders. Furthermore, sometimes practices may seem illiberal to an outsider, but because their social meaning differs from the one given by the outsider, the practice is not illiberal (Horton, 2003).

4. Animals and Multiculturalism

Another topic that has not been explored very much is how multicultural policies can have perverse effects on non-human sentient animals. If a thin conception of non-human sentient animals’ interests is endorsed, it can be understood how animals’ interests may be violated by multicultural policies. Assume that animals have three kinds of interests. First, they have the interest in not having gross suffering inflicted upon them (Casal, 2003; Cochrane, 2007). Second, non-human sentient animals have an interest in some degree of negative freedom: they have an interest in not being physically restricted in cages or forced to undertake hard labor. Third, non-human sentient animals have an interest in having access to resources for their well-being; in particular, non-human sentient animals have an interest in receiving veterinary care and in not being malnourished or denied food. With this modest assumption that animals have an interest in not being treated with cruelty and instead wish to pursue a healthy life, some philosophers have contended that animals’ interests are at risk when giving special rights to groups. There are cultural groups which have practices that interfere with the interests of non-human sentient animals and in terms of multiculturalism these policies may give cultural groups powers that may facilitate animal cruelty. Some cultural groups engage in particular animal slaughtering practices because their religion imposes that meat is cut in a specific way before it is eaten. An example of how multicultural policies can be damaging for non-human sentient animals is if the exemption of minority groups from state laws on animal cruelty could lead to the facilitation of inflicting these harmful practices on animals. In particular, if those groups who practice certain types of animal slaughtering are exempt from animal cruelty laws, then this may facilitate the violation of animals’ interests in not having gross suffering inflicted upon them.

This topic raises also a problem of legitimacy. Most majority societies fail to treat animals with respect and do not usually protect the interests of non-human sentient animals. As a result, a philosophical question that may arise is whether intervention in the practices of minorities mistreat non-human sentient animals would be legitimate, given the fact that majorities themselves fail to treat animals with respect.

5. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

Luís Cordeiro Rodrigues
University of York
United Kingdom

Alasdair Chalmers MacIntyre (1929— )

MacIntyreAlasdair MacIntyre is a Scottish born, British educated, moral and political philosopher who has worked in the United States since 1970.  His work in ethics and politics reaches across disciplines, drawing on sociology and philosophy of the social sciences as well as Greek and Latin classical literature.

MacIntyre began his career as a Marxist, but in the late 1950s, he started working to develop a Marxist ethics that could rationally justify the moral condemnation of Stalinism.  That project eventually led him to reject Marxism along with every other form of “modern liberal individualism” and to propose Aristotle’s ethics as a more effective way to renew moral agency and practical rationality through small-scale moral formation within communities.

MacIntyre’s best known book, After Virtue (1981), is the product of this long ethical project.  After Virtue diagnoses contemporary society as a “culture of emotivism” in which moral language is used pragmatically to manipulate attitudes, choices, and decisions, so that contemporary moral culture is a theater of illusions in which objective moral rhetoric masks arbitrary choices.  MacIntyre followed After Virtue with two books examining the role that traditions play in judgments about truth and falsity, Whose Justice? Which Rationality? (1988) and Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry (1990).  MacIntyre’s next major work, Dependent Rational Animals: Why Human Beings Need the Virtues (1999), investigates the social needs and social debts of human agents, and the role that a community plays in the formation of an independent practical reasoner.  The remainder of MacIntyre’s mature work extends and supplements the arguments of these four major works.

MacIntyre’s philosophy is important to the fields of virtue ethics and communitarian politics, but MacIntyre has denied belonging to either school of thought.  MacIntyre has identified himself as a Thomist since 1984, but some Thomists question his Thomism because he emphasizes Thomas Aquinas’s treatment of human agency but rejects the neo-Thomist project of a creating a Thomist moral epistemology based on the metaphysics of human nature.  MacIntyre continues to point out the irrelevance of conventional business ethics, conceived as an application of modern moral theories to business decision making, but some scholars in the field of business ethics have begun to apply MacIntyre’s Aristotelian account of agency and virtue to the study of organizational systems, to develop ways of renewing moral agency and practical rationality within companies. MacIntyre has played an important role in the renewal of Aristotelian ethics and politics in the last three decades, and has made a valued contribution to the advancement of Thomistic philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Prefatory Comment on "Modern Liberal Individualism"
  3. Development since 1951
    1. The influence of Marx's Theses on Feuerbach in MacIntyre's Moral and Political Work
    2. Three Phases in MacIntyre's Career
      1. Early Career (1949-1971)
        1. Philosophy of Religion
        2. Philosophy of the Social Sciences
        3. Ethics and Politics
      2. Interim (1971-1977)
      3. Mature Work (1977- )
  4. Major works since 1977
    1. After Virtue
      1. Critical Argument of AV
      2. The Constructive Argument of AV
      3. Aristotelian Critique of Modern Ethics and Politics
      4. Criticism of AV
    2. Two Books on Rationality: WJWR and 3RV
      1. Whose Justice? Which Rationality?
      2. Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry
    3. Dependent Rational Animals
    4. The Tasks of Philosophy: Selected Essays, Volume 1
    5. Ethics and Politics: Selected Essays, Volume 2
    6. God, Philosophy, Universities
  5. The Main Themes of MacIntyre's Philosophy
    1. The Ethics and Politics of Human Agency
    2. Ethics and Politics
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Works
    2. Secondary Works

1. Life

Alasdair MacIntyre was born January 12, 1929 in Glasgow, Scotland.  His parents, both of which were physicians, were born and raised in the West of Scotland.  Though Educated in England, he learned Scots Gaelic from one of his aunts.  MacIntyre grew up in and around the city of London. He earned a bachelor’s degree in classics from Queen Mary College in the University of London in the city’s East End in 1949. MacIntyre attended graduate school at Manchester University, a provincial “red brick” university in the North West of England, earning his MA in Philosophy in 1951.

MacIntyre’s family had distant ties to County Donegal, in the North of Ireland, and his knowledge of Gaelic helped MacIntyre to make connections to the people there. He has remained close to the cultural and political concerns of Ireland for many years. MacIntyre “has an intimate and extensive knowledge of Irish literature, both in English and in Irish” (O’Rourke, p. 3). An academic conference celebrating MacIntyre’s eightieth birthday, held at the University College Dublin in 2009, acknowledged and celebrated his ties to the Irish community.

Alasdair MacIntyre’s philosophy builds on an unusual foundation. His early life was shaped by two conflicting systems of values. One was “a Gaelic oral culture of farmers and fishermen, poets and storytellers.” The other was modernity, “The modern world was a culture of theories rather than stories” (MacIntyre Reader, p. 255). MacIntyre embraced both value systems, and carried those divergent worldviews into his undergraduate education.

As a classics major at Queen Mary College in the University of London (1945-1949), MacIntyre read the Greek texts of Plato and Aristotle, but his studies were not limited to the grammars of ancient languages. He also examined the ethical theories of Immanuel Kant and John Stuart Mill. He attended the lectures of analytic philosopher A. J. Ayer and of philosopher of science Karl Popper. He read Ludwig Wittgenstein’s Tractatus Logico Philosophicus, Jean-Paul Sartre’s L'existentialisme est un humanisme, and Marx’s Eighteenth Brumaire of Napoleon Bonaparte (What happened, pp. 17-18). MacIntyre met the sociologist Franz Steiner, who helped direct him toward approaching moralities substantively (interview with Giovanna Borradori, p. 259). MacIntyre’s mature work continues to bridge across conventional disciplinary borders.

MacIntyre’s mature writings also continue to criticize the social and economic orders of modern life. This work also began during his time at Queen Mary College, growing out of his solidarity with the poor and working classes who filled the East End of London where Queen Mary College is located. MacIntyre’s first encounter with the Marxist critiques of liberalism and capitalism (Kinesis Interview,  p. 48) drew MacIntyre into two decades of participation in Marxist organizations (Alasdair MacIntyre's Engagement with Marxism, pp. xiii-l). MacIntyre’s first encounter with the Thomist critique of English social and political life made a strong impression on MacIntyre, but he would not identify himself as a Thomist until 1984 (What happened, p. 17).

From Marxism, MacIntyre learned to see liberalism as a destructive ideology that undermines communities in the name of individual liberty and consequently undermines the moral formation of human agents (interview with Giovanna Borradori, p. 258; Kinesis Interview , p. 47). MacIntyre still acknowledges the insights of The Eighteenth Brumaire of Napoleon Bonaparte (What happened, pp. 20, 483), a book that strips the ideological pretensions from mid-nineteenth century French political rhetoric. For MacIntyre, Marx’s way of seeing through the empty justifications of arbitrary choices to consider the real goals and consequences of political actions in economic and social terms would remain the principal insight of Marxism. MacIntyre found the predictive theories of Marxist social science less convincing. His first book, Marxism: An Interpretation, (1953), criticizes Marx’s turn to social science; similar critiques appear in nearly all of MacIntyre’s major works.

MacIntyre began his teaching career at the University of Manchester as a Lecturer in the Philosophy of Religion in 1951, and held that post until 1957. In a 1956 essay, “Manchester: The Modern University and the English Tradition,” MacIntyre writes with pride about the role of the provincial universities as centers of professional education that are tied in service to the people of their cities, as places that had traditionally been homes to radical politics and non-conformist and minority (Agnostic, Roman Catholic, and Jewish) religion. Marxism: An Interpretation, is similarly an expression of radical politics and non-conformist religion directed to the service of people’s needs. After Manchester, MacIntyre became a member of Britain’s New Left (Alasdair MacIntyre's Engagement with Marxism, pp. xxii-xxxii, 86-93) and moved through teaching, research, and administrative positions at other British universities before emigrating from Britain to the United States in 1970, where his research interests drew him to teaching posts at Brandeis, Boston University, Vanderbilt, Notre Dame, and Duke. MacIntyre returned to Notre Dame in 2000 as the Senior Research Professor in the Notre Dame Center for Ethics and Culture until his retirement in 2010.

MacIntyre began his career as a Marxist Protestant Christian philosopher of religion, basing his work on the fideism of Karl Barth and Wittgenstein’s concept of a form of life (interview with Giovanna Borradori, p. 257). By 1960 he had stopped writing on that subject, and he wrote as an atheist through the sixties and seventies. MacIntyre’s emigration from Great Britain roughly coincides with his break from organized Marxism. In 1968, MacIntyre published a heavily revised version of Marxism: An Interpretation as Marxism and Christianity, and noted in the preface to the new book that he had become skeptical of both. That skepticism remains in Against the Self-Images of the Age (1971).

During the years 1977 through 1984 MacIntyre transitioned to an Aristotelian worldview, returned to the Christian faith and turned from Aristotle to Thomas Aquinas. MacIntyre explains in the preface to The Tasks of Philosophy (2006) that the article “Epistemological Crises, Dramatic Narrative, and the Philosophy of Science” (hereafter EC, 1977) marks the beginning of this transition.

After his retirement from teaching, MacIntyre has continued his work of promoting a renewal of human agency through an examination of the virtues demanded by practices, integrated human lives, and responsible engagement with community life. He is currently affiliated with the Centre for Contemporary Aristotelian Studies in Ethics and Politics (CASEP) at London Metropolitan University.

Alasdair MacIntyre has authored 19 books and edited five others. His most important book, After Virtue (hereafter AV, 1981), has been called one of the most influential works of moral philosophy of the late 20th century. AV and his other major works, including Marxism: An Interpretation (hereafter MI, 1953), A Short History of Ethics (hereafter SHE, 1966), Marxism and Christianity (hereafter M&C, 1968), Against the Self-Images of the Age (hereafter ASIA, 1971), Whose Justice? Which Rationality? (hereafter WJWR, 1988), Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry (hereafter 3RV, 1990), and Dependent Rational Animals (Hereafter DRA, 1999) have shaped academic moral philosophy for six decades.  SHE served as a standard text for college courses in the history of moral philosophy for many years; AV remains a widely used ethics textbook in undergraduate and graduate education. MacIntyre has published about two hundred journal articles and roughly one hundred book reviews, addressing concerns in ethics, politics, the philosophy of the social sciences, Marxist theory, Marxist political practice, the Aristotelian notion of excellence or virtue in human agency, and the interpretation of Thomistic metaphysics, epistemology, and ethics.

MacIntyre’s mature work, initiated by the 1977 essay, “Epistemological Crises, Dramatic Narrative, and the Philosophy of Science” (hereafter EC), draws upon the study of traditions, and the examination of the narratives that inform traditions of scientific, philosophical, and social practice, as a philosophical method. AV and the whole body of work that follows it employ this philosophical method in the study of moral and political philosophy.

2. Prefatory Comment on "Modern Liberal Individualism"

AV rejects the view of “modern liberal individualism” in which autonomous individuals use abstract moral principles to determine what they ought to do. The critique of modern normative ethics in the first half of AV rejects modern moral reasoning for its failure to justify its premises, and criticizes the frequent use of the rhetoric of objective morality and scientific necessity to manipulate people to accept arbitrary decisions. The critical argument gives examples of such manipulative moral rhetoric in ordinary speech, in philosophical ethics, and in the political use of the social sciences. The second half of AV proposes a conception of practice and practical reasoning and the notion of excellence as a human agent as an alternative to modern moral philosophy, presenting what MacIntyre has called “an historicist defense of Aristotle” (AV, p. 277).

MacIntyre’s use of the term “modern liberal individualism” in philosophy is not equivalent to “liberalism” in contemporary politics. Some readers interpreted MacIntyre’s rejection of “modern liberal individualism” to mean that he is a political conservative (AV, 3rd ed., p. xv), but MacIntyre uses “modern liberal individualism” to name a much broader category that includes both liberals and conservatives in contemporary American political parlance, as well as some Marxists and anarchists (See ASIA, pp. 280-284). Conservatism, liberalism, Marxism, and anarchism all present the autonomous individual as the unit of civil society (see “The Theses on Feuerbach: A Road Not Taken.”); none of these political theories can provide a well-developed conception of the common good; and none of them can adequately explain or justify any shared pursuit of any common good.

The sources of modern liberal individualism—Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau—assert that human life is solitary by nature and social by habituation and convention. MacIntyre’s Aristotelian tradition holds, on the contrary, that human life is social by nature. Modern liberal individualism seeks to justify the moral authority of various universal, impersonal moral principles to enable autonomous individuals to make morally correct decisions. But modern moral philosophers use those principles to establish the authority of universal moral norms, and modern autonomous individuals set aside the pursuit of their own goods and goals when they obey these principles and norms in order to judge and act morally. MacIntyre rejects this modern project as incoherent. MacIntyre identifies moral excellence with effective human agency, and seeks a political environment that will help to liberate human agents to recognize and seek their own goods, as components of the common goods of their communities, more effectively. For MacIntyre therefore, ethics and politics are bound together.

3. Development since 1951

Alasdair MacIntyre’s career in moral and political philosophy has passed through many changes, but two themes have remained constant. The first is his critique of modern normative ethics. The second is his approach to moral philosophy as a study of moral formation that strengthens rational human agency and helps to develop a political community of rational agents. The critique of modern normative ethics draws on two sources, the philosophy of Karl Marx, and the emotivism of early twentieth-century logical positivists, including A. J. Ayer and C. L. Stevenson. The search for a truthful ethics and politics of agents in communities draws on action theory, sociology, the philosophy of science and the theme of “revolutionary practice” drawn from Karl Marx’s Theses on Feuerbach.

a. The influence of Marx's Theses on Feuerbach in MacIntyre's Moral and Political Work

MacIntyre has cited the third of Marx’s Theses on Feuerbach, throughout his career (See MI, p. 61; M&C, p. 59, AV, p. 84); he explains the significance of the Theses on Feuerbach in detail in “The Theses on Feuerbach: A Road Not Taken” (hereafter ToF:RNT), published in 1994. Macintyre reads The Theses on Feuerbach as “a genuinely transitional text” (ToF:RNT, p. 224),” marking the end of Marx’s philosophical work with Hegel and Feuerbach, but “pointing in a direction which Marx did not in fact take” (ToF:RNT, p. 226). Hegel and Feuerbach had been critics of “the standpoint of civil society”; which is effectively the standpoint of “modern liberal individualism.” Feuerbach had criticized objects of religious belief as projections of human thought. But Marx found that the theoretical objects of Feuerbach’s philosophy were susceptible to the same critique. In the Theses on Feuerbach, Marx proposed a philosophy that sets aside the contemplation of theoretical objects in order to examine and transform human activity and practice (ToF:RNT, pp. 227-8; see Marx, fourth and first theses).

In the third thesis, Marx complained that Feuerbach and other materialist social theorists invented a determinist theory of human behavior, but applied it as if it did not encompass their own free agency, as if they were superior to society (ToF:RNT, p. 229-30; see also AV, p. 84).  Rejecting this implicit distinction between society and those superior to it, Marx insisted that the leaders and followers of the revolution can only act together, discovering together the ends and methods of the revolution (ToF:RNT, p. 230-1). Marx made this proposal, but did not pursue it. Later Marxist revivals of philosophy have followed two main roads of research, “the dialectical and historical materialism of Plekhanov . . . or . . . the rational voluntarism of the young Lukács” (ToF:RNT, p. 232). For MacIntyre, even at the beginning of his career, The Theses on Feuerbach offered a less traveled road for the recovery of Marxist philosophy that would become essential to MacIntyre’s contributions to moral and political philosophy.

b. Three Phases in MacIntyre's Career

Discussing his career in an interview for the journal Cogito in 1991, MacIntyre identified three distinct phases in his development. During the first period, from 1949 to 1971, MacIntyre published in the philosophy of religion, ethics, the philosophy of the social sciences, and Marxist political and ethical theory without integrating these studies into a unified world view. During the second period, from 1971 to 1977, MacIntyre worked toward the integration of his philosophy. In the third period, from 1977 forward, MacIntyre has been working on “a single project, to which AV, WJWR and 3RV are all central” (Interview for Cogito, in The MacIntyre Reader, p. 269)

i. Early Career (1949-1971)

In his early career, MacIntyre investigated the rational justification of theories and beliefs, and published books and articles in the philosophy of religion, the philosophy of the social sciences, and moral theory. This survey of his early career will take each of these fields in turn.

1. Philosophy of Religion

In the philosophy of religion, the young MacIntyre did not try to justify religious belief rationally; rather he tried to show that religious belief should be exempted from rational examination. The theory he developed in the 1950s was a defensive structure devised to separate MacIntyre’s religious beliefs from the rest of his academic work. MacIntyre’s early fideist philosophy of religion was influenced by the philosophy of Ludwig Wittgenstein and the theology of Karl Barth. For the fideist, religious belief is not, and cannot be rational; its only basis is the acceptance of religious authority. MacIntyre’s Barthian-Wittgensteinian philosophy of religion is nothing more than a rational compartmentalization of religious belief.

The key statement of MacIntyre’s early fideist philosophy of religion is his 1957 essay, “The Logical Status of Religious Belief,” published in the book Metaphysical Beliefs. This essay faced strong criticism from the atheist Antony Flew and the Christian theologian Basil Mitchell. In a 1958 book review, Flew pointed out that traditional Christianity had a closer connection to empirical facts than MacIntyre allowed, and that even if facts about the world could not verify religious belief, it was nonetheless possible for internal incoherence to demonstrate the falsehood of doctrine. Mitchell published a fourteen page critique of MacIntyre’s fideism in 1961 entitled, “The Justification of Religious Belief.” When Metaphysical Beliefs was republished in 1970, MacIntyre added a new preface in which he thanked Flew and Mitchell, along with his colleague Ronald Hepburn, for their criticism, and rejected the essay’s “irrationalism as both false and dangerous” (“Preface to the 1970 Edition,” pp. x–xi).

From the early 1960s through the late 1970s, MacIntyre wrote as an avowed atheist. Three publications in the 1960s, “God and the Theologians,” The Religious Significance of Atheism, and Secularization and Moral Change, express MacIntyre’s atheist convictions.

The reasoning behind MacIntyre’s rejection of his early fideism continues to inform his approach to theism. MacIntyre’s 2010 lecture, “On Being a Theistic Philosopher in a Secularized Culture” does not treat theistic belief as an isolable metaphysical doctrine about the origin and fate of human life. For the mature MacIntyre, theism plays a central role in the interpretation of the world. MacIntyre’s mature theism is not a return to his early fideism; it belongs to a rational worldview that challenges “secular fideists” on the same grounds that it challenges religious ones (WJWR, p. 5).

2. Philosophy of the Social Sciences

MacIntyre’s early work in the philosophy of the social sciences is related to the rational justification of Marxist theory, and to distinguishing the more promising elements of Marx’s early philosophical work from the more pseudoscientific elements of later Marxist and Stalinist theory. Within Marxism, which presented itself through most of the twentieth century as a social science, MacIntyre directed his critique against the crude determinism of Stalinism. More broadly, MacIntyre has questioned the rational justification of any social theory that does not give a central place to the beliefs, intentions, and choices of human agents.

In his unpublished master’s thesis, The Significance of Moral Judgements (hereafter SMJ, 1951), MacIntyre cites Steven Toulmin, “The Logical Status of Psycho-Analysis,” Antony Flew, “Psycho-Analytic Explanation,” and Richard Peters, “Cause, Cure, and Motive,” to criticize Sigmund Freud’s apparent reduction of the moral account of a person’s actions to a causal account of that person’s psychological condition.

MacIntyre remained an outspoken critic of determinist social science throughout the early period of his career. Marxism: An Interpretation criticizes Marx’s turn to determinist social science in The German Ideology (MI, pp. 68-78). M&C, revises this criticism, directing the blame toward Friedrich Engels (M&C, pp.70-74). In the article, “Determinism,” MacIntyre admitted that successful predictions about human behavior from the social sciences made it difficult to dismiss determinism, but given the kinds of interpretative choices required to defend determinism, he found “it difficult to see how determinism could ever be verified or falsified” (pp. 39-40).

3. Ethics and Politics

MacIntyre’s critique of modern normative ethics, if understood as a critique of the normative ethics characteristic of liberal modernity, is rooted partly in the work of Karl Marx. While still a student, MacIntyre had accepted much of the Marxist critique of modern liberal politics as an ideology that sets the individual against the interests of the community. Marx dismissed the notion of “natural rights” as a residue of feudal society in the book review, “On The Jewish Question.” For Marx, “rights” could arise only from laws made by governments. Marx held that “natural rights” or the “rights of man,” as used in nineteenth century liberal politics, served only to protect the individual from the society to which he belonged, and thus threatened both the society and the individual.

MacIntyre’s early Marxism led him to reject every form of modern liberal individualism, “including the liberalism of contemporary American and English conservatives, as well as that of American and European radicals, and even the liberalism of the self-proclaimed liberals.” For these ideological stances, by their constructions of civil society as a response of the individual to universal standards of reason and behavior, “impose a certain kind of unacknowledged domination, and one which in the long run tends to dissolve traditional human ties and to impoverish social and cultural relationships” (Borradori interview, p. 258)

MacIntyre’s critique of modern normative ethics is also influenced by the theory of emotivism. C. L. Stevenson and other emotivists held that moral judgments signify only the subjective interests of their authors, rather than any objective characteristic of the agents and actions they judge. SMJ takes issue with the reductivism of Stevenson’s theory of the meaning of moral judgments, but MacIntyre agrees with most points of Stevenson’s emotivist critique of modern normative ethics, and in this way MacIntyre joins Stevenson’s critique of the intuitionism of G. E. Moore.

Moore had argued in Principia Ethica (1903) that the fundamental task of philosophical ethics was to investigate “assertions about that property of things which is denoted by the term ‘good,’ and the converse property denoted by the term ‘bad’” (Principia Ethica, §23) Moore asserted that “good” must name some specific quality that all good things share, but he found it impossible to define “good” in any adequate way (Principia Ethica, §10). Moore therefore described “good” as a simple, indefinable, non-natural quality.

Logical positivists, including A. J. Ayer (Language Truth and Logic, ch. 6) and C. L. Stevenson could find nothing objective in the “good” that Moore described, and concluded that “good” and “bad” are not objective qualities. Stevenson held that valuations, like “this is a good car” or “that is a good house,” and moral valuations, like “he is a good man,” or “theft is wrong,” are not statements of fact. For Stevenson, evaluative words like “good” and “evil” carry, “emotive meaning” which Stevenson defines as “a tendency of a word, arising through the history of its usage, to produce (result from) affective responses to people” (“The Emotive Meaning of Ethical Terms” p. 23) Emotive terms are used to influence people. Thus the true meaning of any valuation, and particularly of any moral valuation—the significance of moral judgments—is either the speaker’s subjective approval and recommendation, or the speaker’s subjective rejection and proscription. In short, the emotivists held that moral judgments communicate neither facts nor beliefs; they communicate only the emotional interests of their authors.

MacIntyre criticized the reductivism of Stevenson’s conclusions in his MA thesis, but MacIntyre did not criticize Stevenson’s rejection of Moore. MacIntyre explains, “This is not to deny the emotive character of the moral judgment: it is to suggest that when we have said of moral judgments that they are emotive we have left a great deal unsaid—and even the emotive may have a logic to be mapped” (SMJ, p. 89.) MacIntyre’s 1951 assessment of emotivism accepts Stevenson’s critique of the referential meaning of moral judgments (SMJ, p. 74), and with it, the general rejection of “traditional moral philosophy” as a study that uses principles to assess facts (SMJ, p. 81).

For MacIntyre ethics is not an application of principles to facts, but a study of moral action. Moral action, free human action, involves decisions to do things in pursuit of goals, and it involves the understanding of the implications of one’s actions for the whole variety of goals that human agents seek. In this sense, “To act morally is to know how to act” (SMJ, p. 56). “Morality is not a ‘knowing that’ but a ‘knowing how’” (SMJ, p. 89). If human action is a ‘knowing how,’ then ethics must also consider how one learns ‘how.’ Like other forms of ‘knowing how,’ MacIntyre finds that one learns how to act morally within a community whose language and shared standards shape our judgment (SMJ, pp. 68-72). MacIntyre had concluded that ethics is not an abstract exercise in the assessment of facts; it is a study of free human action and of the conditions that enable rational human agency.

Human agency remains a central theme in MacIntyre’s first published book, Marxism: An Interpretation (1953). The book praises those forms of M&C that enable human agency, and criticizes those that inhibit human agency. MacIntyre traces a history from Protestant theology and practice, through the philosophies of Hegel and Feuerbach, to the work of Marx to argue that Marxism is a transformation of Christianity. MacIntyre gives Marx credit for concluding in the third of the Theses on Feuerbach, that the only way to change society is to change ourselves, and that “The coincidence of the changing of human activity or self-changing can only be comprehended and rationally understood as revolutionary practice” (Marx, Theses on Feuerbach, quoted in MI, p. 61). MacIntyre criticizes Marx’s subsequent turn to determinist social science and concludes that “Marx’s transition from prophecy to prediction” transforms Marxism into an alienating myth that divides human beings between “the good who accept Marxism, [and] the wicked who reject it” (MI, p. 89).

The book also examines some shortcomings of Protestant theology and practice, showing how the demands of the gospel inform the ideals of Feuerbach and, through Feuerbach, Marx. MacIntyre distinguishes “religion which is an opiate for the people from religion which is not” (MI, p. 83). He condemns forms of religion that justify social inequities and encourage passivity. He argues that authentic Christian teaching criticizes social structures and encourages action (MI, pp. 119-22).

The MA thesis and MI combine to chart MacIntyre’s initial reply to the emotivist critique of modern normative ethics. They also prefigure MacIntyre’s conflict with R. M. Hare’s response to emotivism. Hare sought to defend modern normative ethics from the emotivist challenge with an alternative account of the meaning of moral judgments. A central claim of Hare’s The Language of Morals (1952), renewed in Freedom and Reason (1963), is that moral judgments are descriptive—not merely emotive—because they are both universalizable and prescriptive. For Hare, universalizability stems from an agent’s commitment to use terms and judgments consistently. For example, “If a person says that a thing is red, he is committed to the view that anything which was like it in the relevant respects would likewise be red” (Freedom and Reason, I 2.2). Thus the prescriptive judgments that agents make are universalizable, insofar as those agents are committed to judging similar things similarly; and it is the universalizability of these prescriptive judgments that gives them descriptive meaning. In short, moral judgments are descriptive because they describe the values chosen by their authors.

MacIntyre rejected Hare’s defense of modern normative ethics in his 1957 essay, “What Morality Is Not.” MacIntyre focuses on Hare’s theory: “It is widely held that it is of the essence of moral valuations that they are universalizable and prescriptive. This is the contention which I wish to deny.” “What Morality is Not” explores the variety of meanings and intentions carried by moral judgments. MacIntyre lists six kinds of moral valuations that are neither universalizable nor prescriptive and concludes that the theory of universal prescriptivism is inadequate for the same reason that emotivism is inadequate; it is reductive. Universal prescriptivism simply fails to give a complete account of the meaning of moral judgments.

“What Morality is Not” also argues that the procedures of modern moral philosophy are superfluous to real moral practice. Where “moral philosophy textbooks” discuss the kinds of maxims that should guide “promise-keeping, truth-telling, and the like,” moral maxims do not guide real agents in real life at all. “They do not guide us because we do not need to be guided. We know what to do” (ASIA, p. 106). Sometimes we do this without any maxims at all, or even against all the maxims we know. MacIntyre Illustrates his point with Huckleberry Finn’s decision to help Jim, Miss Watson’s escaped slave, to make his way to freedom (ASIA, p. 107). Once again, morality is not a “knowing that” but a “knowing how,” and the use of this “knowing how” cannot be reduced to making universalizable prescriptive judgments. MacIntyre’s rejection of Hare’s universal prescriptivism renewed his critique of modern normative ethics, and carried lasting consequences for the Marxist MacIntyre’s response to the moral challenge of Stalinism.

In the late 1950s Marxists throughout the world discovered the hidden atrocities of the Stalinist regime in the Soviet Union, and witnessed the violent suppression of the Hungarian revolution of 1956 (See Virtue and Politics, pp. 134-151). The crimes of the Stalinist regime, including mass murder, mass deportation, and the execution of the intellectual, political, cultural, and ecclesial leadership of subject national communities, demanded condemnation. Yet the moral criticism of Stalinist policies presented a problem to committed Marxist atheists, including MacIntyre, who had rejected theistic notions of divine law as well as modern secular notions of “natural rights.”

MacIntyre discussed the moral condemnation of Stalinism in “Notes from the Moral Wilderness” I & II, (1958 and 59). For MacIntyre, it appeared difficult to condemn Stalinism with any real authority, because any appeal to modern secular liberal moral principle seems to be essentially arbitrary. The ex-communist, liberal critic of Stalinism “can only condemn in the name of his own choice” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 34). MacIntyre’s description of the moral perplexity of these critics of Stalinism resembles his description of Huck Finn a year earlier (ASIA, p. 106); they judged the crimes of Stalin well, but lacked any adequate way to justify their judgments rationally. In “Notes From the Moral Wilderness II,” MacIntyre proposed a new Marxist ethics of human action. Rather than divorcing “the ‘ought’ of morality” from “the ‘is’ of desire” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 41), MacIntyre’s Marxist ethics would look to “the fact of human solidarity which comes to light in the discovery of what we want” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 48).

MacIntyre’s Marxist writings of the early 1960s develop his ethical project. “Communism and British Intellectuals” (1960) argues that the Communist Party of Great Britain is no longer Marxist because it has abandoned Marx’s insight from the third of the Theses on Feuerbach. “Classical Marxism . . . wants to transform the vast mass of mankind from victims and puppets into agents who are masters of their own lives,” but Stalinism had transformed Marxism into the doctrine that scientists should use “the objective and unchangeable laws of history” to manage the behavior of society (Alasdair MacIntyre’s Engagement with Marxism, p. 119). “Freedom and Revolution” (1960) discusses “human initiative” in terms of “desire, intention, and choice” (Alasdair MacIntyre’s Engagement with Marxism, p. 124), and sees the full development of human freedom to require participation in the life of a community: “The problem of freedom is not the problem of the individual against society but the problem of what sort of society we want, and what sort of individuals we want to be” (Alasdair MacIntyre’s Engagement with Marxism, p. 129). The individual should not seek liberation from society, but through society. Morality has to do with one’s participation in the life of one’s community.

MacIntyre develops the ideas that morality emerges from history, and that morality organizes the common life of a community in SHE (1966). The book concludes that the concepts of morality are neither timeless nor ahistorical, and that understanding the historical development of ethical concepts can liberate us “from any false absolutist claims” (SHE, p. 269). Yet this conclusion need not imply that morality is essentially arbitrary or that one could achieve freedom by liberating oneself from the morality of one’s society. In his comments on Plato’s Gorgias in chapter 4, MacIntyre rejects Callicles’ claims that breaking social rules can be liberating. “For a man whose behavior was not rule-governed in any way would have ceased to participate as an intelligible agent in human society” (SHE, p. 32). Elements of SHE return in the histories of AV (1981) and WJWR (1988).

ii. Interim (1971-1977)

The publication of ASIA in 1971 marks the end of the “heterogeneous, badly organized, sometimes fragmented and often frustrating and messy enquiries” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 268) that made up the first part of MacIntyre’s career, and the beginning of “an interim period of sometimes painfully self-critical reflection” that would end with the publication of EC in 1977.

ASIA is a collection of short essays criticizing ideology, contemporary religious practice, Marxist theory and hagiography, modern moral philosophy, reductive approaches to the social sciences, and modern liberal individualism. The essays in the book address most of the issues that would appear a decade later in AV, but they are not synthesized into a single coherent narrative “because,” MacIntyre explains in the preface, “to rescue them from their form as reviews or essays written at a particular time or place would require that I should know how to tie these arguments together into a substantive whole. This I do not yet know how to do. . .” (ASIA, p. x). As MacIntyre himself reports, he spent the interim period from 1971 to 1977 working to bring unity to his philosophical writing (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 268-9). ASIA is a valuable companion to AV because some issues that are treated obscurely in the latter, for example Trotsky’s assessment of the Russian Revolution, are treated in detail in the former (AV, p. 262; ASIA, pp. 52-59).

ASIA’s final essay, “Political and Philosophical Epilogue: A View of The Poverty of Liberalism by Robert Paul Wolff,” introduces some of the most characteristic claims of AV: Various forms of modern liberalism appeal to different theories and principles for their justification. The theories that are used to justify liberal principles may serve as ideological masks that enable “those who profess the principles to deceive not only others but also themselves as to the character of their political action” (ASIA, p. 282). “American conservatism,” “American liberalism,” and “American radicalism” are all forms of modern liberalism, thus “To free ourselves from liberalism, radicalism is the wrong remedy.” Marxism cannot fulfill its promise to teach us how to transform society, but “we can at least learn from it where not to begin” (ASIA, p. 284).

In the Cogito interview, MacIntyre says that by 1971 he had begun to look to Aristotle as the right place to begin to study society in order to understand it and transform it. He “set out to rethink the problems of ethics in a systematic way, taking seriously for the first time the possibility that the history both of modern morality and of modern moral philosophy could only be written adequately from an Aristotelian point of view” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 268).

For MacIntyre, “an Aristotelian point of view” sees teleology inherent in the natures of things, interprets deliberate human activity as voluntary action—not as caused behavior, and finds the human person to be naturally social. From this “Aristotelian point of view,” “modern morality” begins to go awry when moral norms are separated from the pursuit of human goods and moral behavior is treated as an end in itself. This separation characterizes Christian divine command ethics since the fourteenth century and has remained essential to secularized modern morality since the eighteenth century. From MacIntyre’s “Aristotelian point of view,” the autonomy granted to the human agent by modern moral philosophy breaks down natural human communities and isolates the individual from the kinds of formative relationships that are necessary to shape the agent into an independent practical reasoner.

iii. Mature Work (1977- )

In the Preface to The Tasks of Philosophy (2006), MacIntyre explains that the discontinuities of ASIA left him with the question, “How then was I to proceed philosophically?” MacIntyre’s answer came in the 1977 essay “Epistemological Crises, Dramatic Narrative, and the Philosophy of Science” (Hereafter EC). This essay, MacIntyre reports, “marks a major turning-point in my thought in the 1970s” (The Tasks of Philosophy, p. vii) EC may be described fairly as MacIntyre’s discourse on method, and as the title suggests, it presents three general points on the method for philosophy.

First, Philosophy makes progress through the resolution of problems. These problems arise when the theories, histories, doctrines and other narratives that help us to organize our experience of the world fail us, leaving us in “epistemological crises.” Epistemological crises are the aftermath of events that undermine the ways that we interpret our world. Epistemological crises may be deeply personal, triggered by unexpected betrayal or by the loss of religious faith or ideological commitment, or they may be highly speculative, brought on by the failure of trusted theories to explain our experience. To live in an epistemological crisis is to be aware that one does not know what one thought one knew about some particular subject and to be anxious to recover certainty about that subject.

To resolve an epistemological crisis it is not enough to impose some new way of interpreting our experience, we also need to understand why we were wrong before: “When an epistemological crisis is resolved, it is by the construction of a new narrative which enables the agent to understand both how he or she could intelligibly have held his or her original beliefs and how he or she could have been so drastically misled by them” (EC, in The Tasks of Philosophy, p. 5). The resolution of the crisis may lead one to recognize that human understanding is always incomplete and that progress in enquiry is therefore open ended. For MacIntyre, the resolution of an epistemological crisis cannot promise the neat clarity of a shift from a failed body of theory to a truthful one.

To illustrate his position on the open-endedness of enquiry, MacIntyre compares the title characters of Shakespeare’s Hamlet and Jane Austen’s Emma. When Emma finds that she is deeply misled in her beliefs about the other characters in her story, Mr. Knightly helps her to learn the truth and the story comes to a happy ending (p. 6). Hamlet, by contrast, finds no pat answers to his questions; rival interpretations remain throughout the play, so that directors who would stage the play have to impose their own interpretations on the script (p. 5). MacIntyre notes, “Philosophers have customarily been Emmas and not Hamlets” (p. 6); that is, philosophers have treated their conclusions as accomplished truths, rather than as “more adequate narratives” (p. 7) that remain open to further improvement.

The second point of EC addresses the relationship between narratives, truth, and education. The traditional education of children begins in myth, and as children mature they learn to distinguish the lessons of these stories from the fictional events, the truths from the myths. In the course of this education, however, the student grows to respect the myths as bearers of truth. The student who grows through this kind of education to become a scholar “may become . . . a Vico or a Hamann” (p. 8. Johann Georg Hamaan (1730-1788), Giambattista Vico (1668-1744)). Another approach to education is the method of Descartes, who begins by rejecting everything that is not clearly and distinctly true as unreliable and false in order to rebuild his understanding of the world on a foundation of undeniable truth.

Ironically, in the process of rejecting myth, Descartes creates a narrative that is not only mythical but profoundly false. Rather than identifying specific areas of crisis in which he had lost confidence in his understanding of the world and situating himself within the tradition that has formed his understanding and his enquiry, Descartes presents himself as willfully rejecting everything he had believed, and ignores his obvious debts to the Scholastic tradition, even as he argues his case in French and Latin. For MacIntyre, seeking epistemological certainty through universal doubt as a precondition for enquiry is a mistake: “it is an invitation not to philosophy but to mental breakdown, or rather to philosophy as a means of mental breakdown.” David Hume’s cry of pain in his Treatise of Human Nature is the outcome of this kind of philosophical practice (EC, pp. 10-11). MacIntyre contrasts Descartes’ descent into mythical isolation with Galileo, who was able to make progress in astronomy and physics by struggling with the apparently insoluble questions of late medieval astronomy and physics, and radically reinterpreting the issues that constituted those questions.

To make progress in philosophy one must sort through the narratives that inform one’s understanding, struggle with the questions that those narratives raise, and on occasion, reject, replace, or reinterpret portions of those narratives and propose those changes to the rest of one’s community for assessment. Human enquiry is always situated within the history and life of a community. There is no alternative ahistorical, non-traditional way to make progress in human enquiry. MacIntyre returns to this theme in WJWR (chapters 17, 18, 19), in 3RV, and in his Aquinas Lecture, “First Principles, Final Ends, and Contemporary Philosophical Issues” (1990).

The third point of EC is that we can learn about progress in philosophy from the philosophy of science. In particular, “Kuhn’s work criticized provides an illuminating application for the ideas which I have been defending” (EC, p. 15) Kuhn’s The Structure of Scientific Revolutions had argued that scientists practice normal science according to the norms of paradigms or “disciplinary matrices.” Scientific revolutions occur when scientists abandon one paradigm for another. Kuhn’s “paradigm shifts,” however, are unlike MacIntyre’s resolutions of epistemological crises in two ways. First they are not rational responses to specific problems. Kuhn compares paradigm shifts to religious conversions (pp. 150, 151, 158), stressing that they are not guided by rational norms and he claims that the “mopping up” phase of a paradigm shift is a matter of convention in the training of new scientists and attrition among the holdouts of the previous paradigm (Kuhn, pp. 152, 159). Second, the new paradigm is treated as a closed system of belief that regulates a new period of “normal science”; Kuhn’s revolutionary scientists are Emmas, not Hamlets.

MacIntyre takes Kuhn’s position as a restatement of Michael Polyani’s theory that “reason operates only within traditions and communities,” so that transitions between traditions or reconstructions of failed traditions must be irrational (EC, p. 16).  On Kuhn’s account, “scientific revolutions are epistemological crises understood in a Cartesian way. Everything is put in question simultaneously” (EC, p. 17).

MacIntyre proposes elements of Imre Lakatos’ philosophy of science as correctives to Kuhn’s. While Lakatos has his own shortcomings, his general account of the methodologies of scientific research programs recognizes the role of reason in the transitions between theories and between research programs (Lakatos’ analog to Kuhn’s paradigms or disciplinary matrices). Lakatos presents science as an open ended enquiry, in which every theory may eventually be replaced by more adequate theories. For Lakatos, unlike Kuhn, rational scientific progress occurs when a new theory can account both for the apparent promise and for the actual failure of the theory it replaces. The third conclusion of MacIntyre’s essay is that decisions to support some theories over others may be justified rationally to the extent that those theories allow us to understand our experience and our history, including the history of the failures of inadequate theories. EC answers the question that arose from ASIA of how to proceed philosophically. All of MacIntyre’s mature work uses and develops the methodology presented in this essay.

4. Major works since 1977

a. After Virtue

AV (1981, 2nd ed. 1984, 3rd ed. 2007) applies the methodology of EC to many of the same issues addressed in ASIA and in SHE, but interprets the history of ethics and the failure of modern moral philosophy in Aristotelian terms. For Aristotle, moral philosophy is a study of practical reasoning, and the excellences or virtues that Aristotle recommends in the Nicomachean Ethics are the intellectual and moral excellences that make a moral agent effective as an independent practical reasoner. AV criticizes modern liberal individualism and scientific determinism for separating practical reasoning from morality and political life; it proposes instead a return to Aristotelian ethics and politics.

i. Critical Argument of AV

The critical argument of AV, which makes up the first half of the book, begins by examining the current condition of secular moral and political discourse. MacIntyre finds contending parties defending their decisions by appealing to abstract moral principles, but he finds their appeals eclectic, inconsistent, and incoherent.  MacIntyre also finds that the contending parties have little interest in the rational justification of the principles they use. The language of moral philosophy has become a kind of moral rhetoric to be used to manipulate others in defense of the arbitrary choices of its users. What Stevenson had said incorrectly about the meaning of moral judgments has come to be true of the use of moral judgments. MacIntyre reinterprets “emotivism,” Stevenson’s “false theory of meaning” as a “cogent theory of use,” and he names the culture that uses moral rhetoric pragmatically and syncretically “the culture of emotivism.”

MacIntyre traces the lineage of the culture of emotivism to the secularized Protestant cultures of northern Europe (AV, p. 37). These cultures had abandoned any connection between an agent’s natural telos, personal desires, or pursuit of goods and that same agent’s moral duties when they had adopted the divine command moralities of fourteenth, fifteenth, and sixteenth century Christian moral theology. The secular moral philosophers of the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries shared strong and extensive agreements about the content of morality (AV, p. 51) and believed that their moral philosophy could justify the demands of their morality rationally, free from religious authority.

Modern moral philosophy had thus set for itself an incoherent goal. It was to vindicate both the moral autonomy of the individual and the objectivity, necessity, and categorical character of the rules of morality (AV, p. 62). MacIntyre surveys the best efforts to achieve the goals of modern moral philosophy but dismisses each one as a moral fiction.

Given the failure of modern moral philosophy, MacIntyre turns to an apparent alternative, the pragmatic expertise of professional managers. Managers are expected to appeal to the facts to make their decisions on the objective basis of effectiveness, and their authority to do this is based on their knowledge of the social sciences. An examination of the social sciences reveals, however, that many of the facts to which managers appeal depend on sociological theories that lack scientific status. Thus, the predictions and demands of bureaucratic managers are no less liable to ideological manipulation than the determinations of modern moral philosophers.

If modern morality has been revealed to be “a theater of illusions,” then we must reject it, and this rejection can take two forms. Either we follow Nietzsche and defend the autonomy of the individual against the arbitrary demands of conventional moral reasoning, or we reject both moral autonomy and arbitrary conventional moral reasoning to follow Aristotle and investigate practical reason and the role of moral formation in preparing the human agent to succeed as an independent practical reasoner.

The critical argument of AV raises serious questions about the rational justification of modern moral philosophy, and it also proposes an explanation for the rational failure of modern moral philosophy: Modern moral philosophy separates moral reasoning about duties and obligations from practical reasoning about ends and practical deliberation about the means to one’s ends, and in doing so it separates morality from practice. Kant separates moral and practical reasoning explicitly in The Critique of Pure Reason (Critique of Pure Reason, A800/B828–A819/B847) and in The Foundations of the Metaphysics of Morals (First Section, pp. 393-405.); Mill makes the same separation in Utilitarianism (chapter 2).

MacIntyre compares the separation of morality from practice or the separation of moral reasoning from practical reasoning in modern moral philosophy to the separation of morality from practice in Polynesian taboo. The Polynesians had lost the practical justifications for their well-established moral customs by the time they first made contact with European explorers; so when they told these visitors that certain practices were forbidden because those practices were “taboo,” they were unable to explain why these practices were forbidden or what, precisely, “taboo” meant. Many Europeans also lost the practical justifications for their moral norms as they approached modernity; for these Europeans, claiming that certain practices are “immoral,” and invoking Kant’s categorical imperative or Mill’s principle of utility to explain why those practices are immoral, seems no more adequate than the Polynesian appeal to taboo. The comparison between modern morality and taboo is a recurring theme in MacIntyre’s ethical work.

MacIntyre’s critique of the separation of morality from practice also draws on his criticism of determinist social science. Practice involves free and deliberate human action, while morality divorced from practice regulates only outward human behavior. Determinist social scientists, notably Stalinists but also behaviorists like W.V. Quine, viewed human behaviors as determined responses to various kinds of causal factors, and refused to examine the things people do in terms of “intentions, purposes, and reasons for action” (Quine, quoted in AV, p. 83). Instead, determinist social scientists sought “law-like generalizations” about the connections of these causes to their behavioral effects, which would enable them to predict human behavior, and bring scientific understanding to the work of organizational management (AV, pp. 88–91).

ii. The Constructive Argument of AV

In the second half of AV, MacIntyre explores the moral tradition that examines human judgment, human weakness, and excellence in human action. The constructive argument of the second half of the book begins with traditional accounts of the excellences or virtues of practical reasoning and practical rationality rather than virtues of moral reasoning or morality. These traditional accounts define virtue as arête, as excellence, and all of the definitions offered in the second half of AV describe the excellence of the human agent who judges well and acts effectively in pursuit of desired ends. MacIntyre sifts these definitions and then gives his own definition of virtue, as excellence in human agency, in terms of practices, whole human lives, and traditions in chapters 14 and 15 of AV.

In the most often quoted sentence of AV, MacIntyre defines a practice as (1) a complex social activity that (2) enables participants to gain goods internal to the practice. (3) Participants achieve excellence in practices by gaining the internal goods. When participants achieve excellence, (4) the social understandings of excellence in the practice, of the goods of the practice, and of the possibility of achieving excellence in the practice “are systematically extended” (AV, p. 187).

Practices, like chess, medicine, architecture, mechanical engineering, football, or politics, offer their practitioners a variety of goods both internal and external to these practices. The goods internal to practices include forms of understanding or physical abilities that can be acquired only by pursuing excellence in the associated practice. Goods external to practices include wealth, fame, prestige, and power; there are many ways to gain these external goods. They can be earned or purchased, either honestly or through deception; thus the pursuit of these external goods may conflict with the pursuit of the goods internal to practices.

MacIntyre illustrates the conflict between the pursuits of internal and external goods in the parable of the chess playing child. An intelligent child is given the opportunity to win candy by learning to play chess. As long as the child plays chess only to win candy, he has every reason to cheat if by doing so he can win more candy. If the child begins to desire and pursue the goods internal to chess, however, cheating becomes irrational, because it is impossible to gain the goods internal to chess or any other practice except through an honest pursuit of excellence. Goods external to practices may nevertheless remain tempting to the practitioner.

Practices are supported by institutions like chess clubs, hospitals, universities, industrial corporations, sports leagues, and political organizations. Practices exist in tension with these institutions, since the institutions tend to be oriented to goods external to practices. Universities, hospitals, and scholarly societies may value prestige, profitability, or relations with political interest groups above excellence in the practices they are said to support.

Personal desires and institutional pressures to pursue external goods may threaten to derail practitioners’ pursuits of the goods internal to practices. MacIntyre defines virtue initially as the quality of character that enables an agent to overcome these temptations: “A virtue is an acquired human quality the possession and exercise of which tends to enable us to achieve those goods which are internal to practices and the lack of which effectively prevents us from achieving any such goods” (AV, p. 191).

MacIntyre finds that this first level definition is inadequate to describe an excellent human agent. It is not enough to be an excellent navigator, physician, or builder; the excellent human agent lives an excellent life. Excellence as a human agent cannot be reduced to excellence in a particular practice (See AV, pp. 204–205, and Ethics and Politics, pp. 196–7). MacIntyre therefore adds a second level to his definition of virtue.

The virtues therefore are to be understood as those dispositions which will not only sustain practices and enable us to achieve the goods internal to practices, but which will also sustain us in the relevant kind of quest for the good, by enabling us to overcome the harms, dangers, temptations, and distractions which we encounter, and which will furnish us with increasing self-knowledge and increasing knowledge of the good (AV, p. 219).

The excellent human agent has the moral qualities to seek what is good and best both in practices and in life as a whole.

The second level definition is still inadequate, however, because it does not take into account the individual’s response to the life and legacy of her or his community. MacIntyre rejects individualism and insists that we view human beings as members of communities who bear specific debts and responsibilities because of our social identities. The responsibilities one may inherit as a member of a community include debts to one’s forbearers that one can only repay to people in the present and future. These responsibilities also include debts incurred by the unjust actions of ones’ predecessors.

MacIntyre acknowledges that contemporary individualism insists that “the self is detachable from its social and historical roles and statuses” (AV, p. 221), but he illustrates his counterpoint point with three national communities in which contemporary citizens continue to bear the debts of their predecessors. The enslavement and oppression of black Americans, the subjugation of Ireland, and the genocide of the Jews in Europe remained quite relevant to the responsibilities of citizens of the United States, England, and Germany in 1981, as they still do today.  Thus an American who said “I never owned any slaves,” “the Englishman who says ‘I never did any wrong to Ireland,’” or “the young German who believes that being born after 1945 means that what Nazis did to Jews has no moral relevance to his relationship to his Jewish contemporaries” all exhibit a kind of intellectual and moral failure. “I am born with a past, and to cut myself off from that past in the individualist mode, is to deform my present relationships” (p. 221).  For MacIntyre, there is no moral identity for the abstract individual; “The self has to find its moral identity in and through its membership in communities” (p. 221).

Since MacIntyre finds social identity necessary for the individual, MacIntyre’s definition of the excellence or virtue of the human agent needs a social dimension:

The virtues find their point and purpose not only in sustaining those relationships necessary if the variety of goods internal to practices are to be achieved and not only in sustaining the form of an individual life in which that individual may seek out his or her good as the good of his or her whole life, but also in sustaining those traditions which provide both practices and individual lives with their necessary historical context (AV, p. 223).

This third, social, level completes MacIntyre’s account of the excellence of the human agent in AV.

iii. Aristotelian Critique of Modern Ethics and Politics

The remaining chapters of AV contrast MacIntyre’s Aristotelian notion of the virtues as excellences of character from modern notions of virtue as the quality of a person who obeys moral rules. These chapters also lay out some of the practical implications of MacIntyre’s Aristotelian project for contemporary ethics and politics. The loss of teleology makes morality appear arbitrary (AV, p. 236), separates moral reason from practical and political reasoning (AV, p. 236), and removes the notion of what one deserves from modern notions of justice (AV, p. 249). MacIntyre concludes that “modern systematic politics . . . expresses in its institutional forms a systematic rejection” of the Aristotelian tradition of the virtues and therefore “has to be rejected” by those who commit themselves to the tradition of the virtues (AV, p. 255). In other words, those who approach moral and political philosophy in terms of the development of the human agent and the advancement of practical reasoning in the context of the life of a community cannot succeed in their task if they compromise their work by committing themselves to the arbitrary goals, methods, and language of modern politics.

At the end of the argument of AV, MacIntyre returns to the ultimatum of chapter 10, “Nietzsche or Aristotle.” Where Nietzsche intended his work as a critique of modern morality, Nietzsche in fact becomes the ultimate embodiment of the moral isolation and arbitrariness of modern liberal individualism. This fault remains invisible from a modern viewpoint, but when viewed from the perspective of the Aristotelian tradition of the virtues, it is quite clear (AV, pp. 258-259).

Since “goods, and with them the only grounds for the authority of laws and virtues, can only be discovered by entering into those relationships which constitute communities whose central bond is a shared vision of and understanding of goods” (AV, p. 258), any hope for the transformation and renewal of society depends on the development and maintenance of such communities. Revolution cannot be imposed (AV, p. 238), although it may be cultivated. To wait “for another—doubtless very different—St. Benedict,” is to await a person who can unify communities that encourage moral formation in judgment and action.

iv. Criticism of AV

MacIntyre’s Aristotelian approach to ethics as a study of human action distinguishes him from post-Kantian moral philosophers who approach ethics as a means of determining the demands of objective, impersonal, universal morality. This modern approach may be described as moral epistemology. Modern moral philosophy pretends to free the individual to determine for her- or himself what she or he must do in a given situation, irrespective of her or his own desires; it pretends to give knowledge of universal moral laws. MacIntyre rejects modern ethical theories as deceptive and self-deceiving masks for conventional morality and for arbitrary interventions against traditions. For MacIntyre, the freedom of self-determination is the freedom to recognize and pursue one’s good, and moral philosophy liberates the agent, in part, by helping the human agent to desire what is good and best, and to choose what is good and best.

MacIntyre’s ethics of human action also distinguishes his later Thomistic work from the efforts of some twentieth-century neo-Thomists to craft a moral epistemology out of Thomas Aquinas’s metaphysics and natural law. AV argues that an Aristotelian ethics of virtue may remain possible, without appealing to Aristotle’s metaphysics of nature. This claim remains controversial for two different, but closely related reasons.

Many of those who rejected MacIntyre’s turn to Aristotle define “virtue” primarily along moral lines, as obedience to law or adherence to some kind of natural norm. For these critics, “virtuous” appears synonymous with “morally correct;” their resistance to MacIntyre’s appeal to virtue stems from their difficulties either with what they take to be the shortcomings of MacIntyre’s account of moral correctness or with the notion of moral correctness altogether.  Thus one group of critics rejects MacIntyre’s Aristotelianism because they hold that any Aristotelian account of the virtues must first account for the truth about virtue in terms of Aristotle’s philosophy of nature, which MacIntyre had dismissed in AV as “metaphysical biology” (AV, pp. 162, 179). Aristotelian metaphysicians, particularly Thomists who define virtue in terms of the perfection of nature, rejected MacIntyre’s contention that an adequate Aristotelian account of virtue as excellence in practical reasoning and human action need not appeal to Aristotelian metaphysics. Another group of critics, including materialists, dismissed MacIntyre’s attempt to recover an Aristotelian account of the virtues because they took those virtues to presuppose an indefensible metaphysical doctrine of nature.

A few years after the publication of AV, MacIntyre became a Thomist and accepted that the teleology of human action flowed from a metaphysical foundation in the nature of the human person (WJWR, ch. 10; AV, 3rd ed., p. xi). Nonetheless, MacIntyre has the main points of his ethics and politics of human action have remained the same. MacIntyre continues to argue toward an Aristotelian account of practical reasoning through the investigation of practice. Even though he has accepted Thomistic metaphysics, he seldom argues from metaphysical premises, and when pressed to explain the metaphysical foundations of his ethics, he has demurred. MacIntyre continues to argue from the experience of practical reasoning to the demands of moral education. MacIntyre’s work in WJWR, DRA, The Tasks of Philosophy, Ethics and Politics, and God, Philosophy, University continue to exemplify the phenomenological approach to moral education that MacIntyre took in After Virtue.

Contemporary scholars have defended MacIntyre’s unconventional Aristotelianism by challenging the conventions that MacIntyre is said to violate. Christopher Stephen Lutz examined some of the reasons for rejecting “Aristotle’s metaphysical biology” and assessed the compatibility of MacIntyre’s philosophy with that of Thomas Aquinas in Tradition in the Ethics of Alasdair MacIntyre (2004, pp. 133-140). Kelvin Knight took a broader approach in Aristotelian Philosophy: Ethics and Politics from Aristotle to MacIntyre (2007). Knight examined the ethics and politics of human action found in Aristotle and traced the development of that project through medieval and modern thought to MacIntyre. Knight distinguishes Aristotle’s ethics of human action from his metaphysics and shows how it is possible for MacIntyre to retrieve Aristotle’s ethics of human action without first defending Aristotle’s metaphysical account of nature.

b. Two Books on Rationality: WJWR and 3RV

For MacIntyre, “rationality” comprises all the intellectual resources, both formal and substantive, that we use to judge truth and falsity in propositions, and to determine choice-worthiness in courses of action. Rationality in this sense is not universal; it differs from community to community and from person to person, and may both develop and regress over the course of a person’s life or a community’s history. MacIntyre describes this culturally relative, even subjective characteristic of rationality in the first chapter of WJWR (1988):

So rationality itself, whether theoretical or practical, is a concept with a history: indeed, since there are also a diversity of traditions of enquiry, with histories, there are, so it will turn out, rationalities rather than rationality, just as it will also turn out that there are justices rather than justice (WJWR, p. 9).

Rationality is the collection of theories, beliefs, principles, and facts that the human subject uses to judge the world, and a person’s rationality is, to a large extent, the product of that person’s education and moral formation.

To the extent that a person accepts what is handed down from the moral and intellectual traditions of her or his community in learning to judge truth and falsity, good and evil, that person’s rationality is “tradition-constituted.” Tradition-constituted rationality provides the schemata by which we interpret, understand, and judge the world we live in. The apparent reasonableness of mythical explanations, religious doctrines, scientific theories, and the conflicting demands of the world’s moral codes all depend on the tradition-constituted rationalities of those who judge them. For this reason, some of MacIntyre’s critics have argued that tradition-constituted rationality entails an absolute relativism in philosophy.

The apparent problem of relativism in MacIntyre’s theory of rationality is much like the problem of relativism in the philosophy of science. Scientific claims develop within larger theoretical frameworks, so that the apparent truth of a scientific claim depends on one’s judgment of the larger framework. The resolution of the problem of relativism therefore appears to hang on the possibility of judging frameworks or rationalities, or judging between frameworks or rationalities from a position that does not presuppose the truth of the framework or rationality, but no such theoretical standpoint is humanly possible. Nonetheless, MacIntyre finds that the world itself provides the criterion for the testing of rationalities, and he finds that there is no criterion except the world itself that can stand as the measure of the truth of any philosophical theory. So MacIntyre balances the relativity of rationality against the objectivity of the world that we investigate. As Popper and Lakatos found in the philosophy of science, MacIntyre concludes that experience can falsify theory, releasing people from the apparent authority of traditional rationalities.

MacIntyre holds that the rationality of individuals is not only tradition-constituted, it is also tradition constitutive, as individuals make their own contributions to their own rationality, and to the rationalities of their communities. Rationality is not fixed, within either the history of a community or the life of a person. Unexplainable events can occur that reveal shortcomings in a person’s rational resources, like the anomalous data that precipitate scientific revolutions in Thomas Kuhn’s The Structure of Scientific Revolutions or demand changes in research programmes in Imre Lakatos’ The Methodology of Scientific Research Programmes. Problems exposed by anomalous data or by conflicts with other traditions, other communities, or other people may prove rationally insoluble under the constraints that a given tradition places on rationality. Such events, when fully recognized, demand creative solutions, and it may happen that some person or group will discover what appears to be a more adequate response to those problems. To the extent that these new solutions are adopted by others and passed on to subsequent generations (for better or for worse), the rationality of those responsible for the new approach becomes “tradition-constitutive.”

The possibility that experience may falsify theory distinguishes MacIntyre’s theory of tradition-constituted and tradition-constitutive rationality from forms of relativism that make rationality entirely tradition-dependent or entirely subjective. Nonetheless, MacIntyre denies that such falsification is common (WJWR, chs. 18 and 19), and history shows us that individuals, communities, and even whole nations may commit themselves militantly over long periods of their histories to doctrines that their ideological adversaries find irrational. This qualified relativism of appearances has troublesome implications for anyone who believes that philosophical enquiry can easily provide certain knowledge of the world. According to MacIntyre, theories govern the ways that we interpret the world and no theory is ever more than “the best standards so far” (3RV, p. 65). Our theories always remain open to improvement, and when our theories change, the appearances of our world—the apparent truths of claims judged within those theoretical frameworks—change with them.

From the subjective standpoint of the human enquirer, MacIntyre finds that theories, concepts, and facts all have histories, and they are all liable to change—for better or for worse. MacIntyre’s philosophy offers a decisive refutation of modern epistemology, even as it maintains philosophy is a quest for truth. MacIntyre’s philosophy is indebted to the philosophy of science, which recognizes the historicism of scientific enquiry even as it seeks a truthful understanding of the world. MacIntyre’s philosophy does not offer a priori certainty about any theory or principle; it examines the ways in which reflection upon experience supports, challenges, or falsifies theories that have appeared to be the best theories so far to the people who have accepted them so far. MacIntyre’s ideal enquirers remain Hamlets, not Emmas.

i. Whose Justice? Which Rationality?

WJWR presents MacIntyre’s most thorough argument for his theory of rationality. He summarizes the main points of his theory in chapter 1. In chapters 2 through 16, MacIntyre follows the progress of the Western tradition through “three distinct traditions:” from Homer and Aristotle to Thomas Aquinas, from Augustine to Thomas Aquinas and from Augustine through Calvin to Hume (WJWR, p. 326). The inhabitants of these traditions work to deepen, correct, and extend the claims and theories of their predecessors. Chapter 17 examines the modern liberal denial of tradition, and the ironic transformation of liberalism into the fourth tradition to be treated in the book. Chapter 18 reviews MacIntyre’s claims and conclusions concerning the tradition-constituted nature and tradition-constitutive power of human rationality. Chapters 19 and 20 explore the consequences of MacIntyre’s theory for conflicts between traditions.

WJWR fulfills a promise made at the end of AV: “I promised a book in which I should attempt to say both what makes it rational to act in one way rather than another and what makes it rational to advance and defend one conception of practical rationality rather than another. Here it is” (p. 9). To fulfill this promise, MacIntyre opens the book by arguing that “the Enlightenment made us . . . blind to . . . a conception of rational enquiry as embodied in a tradition, a conception according to which the standards of rational justification themselves emerge from and are part of a history.” From the standpoint of human enquiry, no group can arrogate to itself the authority to guide everyone else toward the good. We can only struggle together in our quests for justice and truth and each community consequently frames and revises its own standards of justice and rationality. MacIntyre concludes that neither reason nor justice is universal: “since there are a diversity of traditions of enquiry, with histories, there are, so it will turn out, rationalities rather than rationality, just as it will also turn out that there are justices rather than justice” (p. 9).

The thesis that rationalities and justices arise from the histories and traditions of communities sets MacIntyre squarely at odds with all modern philosophy, and particularly with the unacknowledged imperialism of any form of metaethics that would offer a neutral, third-party forum in which to adjudicate the practical differences between contending moral traditions by the peculiar standards of modern liberal individualism. The same thesis also appears to set MacIntyre at odds with the traditions of Aristotle and Thomas Aquinas—traditions he claims to accept and defend—which make unambiguous claims about the universal nature, true reason, and objective justice. The book therefore has two tasks. On the one hand, the book relates the histories of particular rationalities and justices in a way that undermines the abstract universal notions of reason and justice that provide the foundations for modern moral and political thought. On the other hand, the book provides prima facie evidence

that those who have thought their way through the topics of justice and practical rationality, from the standpoint constructed by and in the direction pointed out first by Aristotle and then by Aquinas, have every reason at least so far to hold that the rationality of their tradition has been confirmed by its encounters with other traditions (p. 403).

In short, the book offers an internal critique of modernity, arguing that it is incoherent by its own standards, and it offers an internal justification of Thomism, holding that Thomism is rationally justified, for Thomists, by Thomist standards. Contrary to initial expectations, MacIntyre’s historicist, particularist critique of modernity is compatible with the historically situated Thomist tradition.

MacIntyre holds that his historicist, particularist critique of modernity is consistent with Thomism because of the way that he understands the acquisition of first principles. In chapter 10 (pp. 164-182), MacIntyre compares Thomas Aquinas’s account of the acquisition of first principles with those of Descartes, Hobbes, Hume, Bentham, and Kant. MacIntyre explains that according to Thomas Aquinas, individuals reach first principles through “a work of dialectical construction” (p. 174). For Thomas Aquinas, by questioning and examining one’s experience, one may eventually arrive at first principles, which one may then apply to the understanding of one’s questions and experience. Descartes and his successors, by contrast, along with certain “notable Thomists of the last hundred years” (p. 175), have proposed that philosophy begins from knowledge of some “set of necessarily true first principles which any truly rational person is able to evaluate as true” (p. 175). Thus for the moderns, philosophy is a technical rather than moral endeavor, while for the Thomist, whether one might recognize first principles or be able to apply them depends in part on one’s moral development (pp. 186-182).

The modern account of first principles justifies an approach to philosophy that rejects tradition. The modern liberal individualist approach is anti-traditional. It denies that our understanding is tradition-constituted and it denies that different cultures may differ in their standards of rationality and justice:

The standpoint of traditions is necessarily at odds with one of the central characteristics of cosmopolitan modernity: the confident belief that all cultural phenomena must be potentially translucent to understanding, that all texts must be capable of being translated into the language which the adherents of modernity speak to one another (p. 327)

Modernity does not see tradition as the key that unlocks moral and political understanding, but as a superfluous accumulation of opinions that tend to prejudice moral and political reasoning.

Although modernity rejects tradition as a method of moral and political enquiry, MacIntyre finds that it nevertheless bears all the characteristics of a moral and political tradition. MacIntyre identifies the peculiar standards of the liberal tradition in the latter part of chapter 17, and summarizes the story of the liberal tradition at the outset of chapter 18:

Liberalism, beginning as a repudiation of tradition in the name of abstract, universal principles of reason, turned itself into a politically embodied power, whose inability to bring its debates on the nature and context of those universal principles to a conclusion has had the unintended effect of transforming liberalism into a tradition (p. 349).

From MacIntyre’s perspective, there is no question of deciding whether or not to work within a tradition; everyone who struggles with practical, moral, and political questions simply does. “There is no standing ground, no place for enquiry . . . apart from that which is provided by some particular tradition or other” (p. 350). MacIntyre calls his position “the rationality of traditions.”

MacIntyre distinguishes two related challenges to his position, the “relativist challenge” and the “perspectivist challenge.” These two challenges both acknowledge that the goals of the Enlightenment cannot be met and that, “the only available standards of rationality are those made available by and within traditions” (p. 252); they conclude that nothing can be known to be true or false. For these post-modern theorists, “if the Enlightenment conceptions of truth and rationality cannot be sustained,” either relativism or perspectivism “is the only possible alternative” (p. 353). MacIntyre rejects both challenges by developing his theory of tradition-constituted and tradition-constitutive rationality on pp. 354-369.

How, then, is one to settle challenges between two traditions? It depends on whether the adherents of either take the challenges of the other tradition seriously. It depends on whether the adherents of either tradition, on seeing a failure in their own tradition are willing to consider an answer offered by their rival (p. 355). There is nothing in MacIntyre’s account of the rationality of traditions that suggest that the superior traditions will vanquish inferior ones, or to provide any analogue to the modern, enlightenment, or Cartesian epistemological first principles that he rejected in his critique of the modern liberal individualist tradition.

MacIntyre emphasizes the role of tradition in the final chapter of the book by asking how a person with no traditional affiliation is to deal with the conflicting claims of rival traditions: “The initial answer is: that will depend upon who you are and how you understand yourself. This is not the kind of answer which we have been educated to expect in philosophy” (p. 393). Such a person might, through some process of reflection on experience and engagement with the claims of one tradition or another, join a tradition whose claims and standards appear compelling, but there is no guarantee of that. MacIntyre’s conclusion is that enquiry is situated within traditions.

WJWR is more than a restatement of the history from AV. AV had argued that an Aristotelian view of moral philosophy as a study of human action could make sense of the failure of modern moral philosophy while modern liberal individualism could not. Aristotelian and Thomist critics complained, however, that MacIntyre’s Aristotelianism, which sought its foundation in teleological activity rather than teleological metaphysics, remained open to the challenge that it was relativistic. WJWR advances the argument of AV in two ways. First, MacIntyre focuses the critique of modernity on the question of rational justification. Modern epistemology stands or falls on the possibility of Cartesian epistemological first principles. MacIntyre’s history exposes that notion of first principle as a fiction, and at the same time demonstrates that rational enquiry advances (or declines) only through tradition. Second, MacIntyre trades the social teleology of AV for a Thomist, metaphysical teleology. MacIntyre justifies this trade in terms acceptable within the Thomist tradition, and acknowledges that those who find Thomism irrational will find little reason to accept it (WJWR P. 403). This general conclusion remained troubling for Aristotelians, and particularly for those Neo-Thomists whose Neo-Scholastic tradition bore debts to the Cartesian tradition.

ii. Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry

MacIntyre presented his theory of rationality again in his 1988 Gifford Lectures, published as Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry (1990). The central idea of the Gifford Lectures is that philosophers make progress by addressing the shortcomings of traditional narratives about the world, shortcomings that become visible either through the failure of traditional narratives to make sense of experience, or through the introduction of contradictory narratives that prove impossible to dismiss. This vision of progress in philosophy is the same as that of EC, and WJWR, but the presentation is different. In this book, MacIntyre compares three traditions exemplified by three literary works published near the end of Adam Gifford’s life (1820–1887);  a bequest of Lord Gifford’s will funds the Gifford Lectures.  The Ninth Edition of the Encyclopaedia Britannica (1875–1889) represents the modern tradition of trying to understand the world objectively without the influence of tradition.  The Genealogy of Morals (1887), by Friedrich Nietzsche embodies the post-modern tradition of interpreting all traditions as arbitrary impositions of power.  The encyclical letter Aeterni Patris (1879) of Pope Leo XIII exemplifies the approach of acknowledging one’s predecessors within one’s own tradition of enquiry and working to advance or improve that tradition in the pursuit of objective truth.  Of the three versions of moral enquiry treated in 3RV, only tradition, exemplified in 3RV by the Aristotelian, Thomistic tradition, understands itself as a tradition that looks backward to predecessors in order to understand present questions and move forward. Encyclopaedia, concerns itself only with present facts, and leaves the problems of intellectual history to others. Genealogy defends an historicist interpretation of the past to undermine what it takes to be irrational moral convictions in the present. MacIntyre argues that Encyclopaedists and Genealogists deceive themselves in their rejections of the method of tradition.

Encyclopaedia obscures the role of tradition by presenting the most current conclusions and convictions of a tradition as if they had no history, and as if they represented the final discovery of unalterable truth. In this sense, Encyclopaedia represents the epistemological “Emmas” of MacIntyre’s 1977 essay, EC. Encyclopaedists focus on the present and ignore the past.

Genealogists, on the other hand, focus on the past in order to undermine the claims of the present. The “Nietzschean research program” has three uses for history: (1) to reduce academic history to a projection of the concerns of modern historians, (2) to dissipate the identity of the historian into a collection of inherited cultural influences, and (3) to undermine the notion of “progress towards truth and reason” (3RV, pp. 49-50). In short, Genealogy denies the teleology of human enquiry by denying (1) that historical enquiry has been fruitful, (2) that the enquiring person has a real identity, and (3) that enquiry has a real goal. MacIntyre finds this mode of enquiry incoherent.

To provide an example of the incoherence of the Genealogical mode of enquiry MacIntyre turns to Foucault and begins by describing the “self-endangering paradox” Foucault—or anyone who would maintain and extend the Nietzschean research program—must face: “the insights conferred by this post-Nietzschean understanding of the uses of history are themselves liable to subvert the project of understanding the project” (3RV, p. 50). MacIntyre argues against each of the three Nietzschean uses of history, beginning with the denial of the fruitfulness of the study.

MacIntyre cites Foucault’s 1966 book, Les Mots et les choses (The Order of Things, 1970) as an example of the self-subverting character of Genealogical enquiry. Foucault’s book reduces history to a procession of “incommensurable ordered schemes of classification and representation” none of which has any greater claim to truth than any other, yet this book “is itself organized as a scheme of classification and representation.” In the light of its own account of history, it seems difficult to justify the claims of the book rationally. If historical narratives are only projections of the interests of historians, then it is difficult to see how this historical narrative can claim to be truthful.

Genealogical moral enquiry cannot make sense of its own claims without exempting those claims from its general critique of similar claims. Genealogical moral enquiry must make similar exceptions to its treatments of the unity of the enquiring subject and the teleology of moral enquiry; thus “it seems to be the case that the intelligibility of genealogy requires beliefs and allegiances of a kind precluded by the genealogical stance” (3RV, p. 54-55). Genealogy is self-deceiving insofar as it ignores the traditional and teleological character of its enquiry.

3RV uses Thomism as its example of tradition, but this use should not suggest that MacIntyre identifies “tradition” with Thomism or Thomism-as-a-name-for-the-Western-tradition. As noted above, WJWR distinguished four traditions of enquiry within the Western European world alone (WJWR, p. 349). MacIntyre uses Thomism because it applies the traditional mode of enquiry in a self-conscious manner. Thomistic students learn the work of philosophical enquiry as apprentices in a craft (3RV, p. 61), and maintain the principles of the tradition in their work to extend the understanding of the tradition, even as they remain open to the criticism of those principles.

Tradition differs from both encyclopaedia and genealogy in the way it understands the place of its theories in the history of human enquiry. The adherent of a tradition must understand that “the rationality of a craft is justified by its history so far,” thus it “is inseparable from the tradition through which it was achieved” (3RV, p. 65). To justify the claims of a tradition is to recount how the tradition has developed and understood those claims so far. To master a tradition is also “a matter of knowing how to go further, and especially how to direct others towards going further, using what can be learned from the tradition afforded by the past to move towards the telos of fully perfected work” (3RV, pp. 65-66). Tradition is not merely conservative; it remains open to improvement, and in the 1977 essay EC, it is Hamlet, not Emma, who exemplifies the traditional mode of enquiry.

MacIntyre’s emphasis on the temporality of rationality in traditional enquiry makes tradition incompatible with the epistemological projects of modern philosophy (3RV, pp. 69).

MacIntyre uses Thomas Aquinas to illustrate the revolutionary potential of traditional enquiry. Thomas was educated in Augustinian theology and Aristotelian philosophy, and through this education he began to see not only the contradictions between the two traditions, but also the strengths and weaknesses that each tradition revealed in the other. His education also helped him to discover a host of questions and problems that had to be answered and solved. Many of Thomas Aquinas’ responses to these concerns took the form of disputed questions. “Yet to each question the answer produced by Aquinas as a conclusion is no more than and, given Aquinas’s method, cannot but be no more than, the best answer reached so far. And hence derives the essential incompleteness” (3RV, p. 124). Thomas Aquinas, viewed as practicing the traditional mode of enquiry, is one influential practitioner within a tradition and his writings are contributions to that tradition, rather than collections of unassailable final conclusions. MacIntyre’s Thomistic responses to encyclopedia and genealogy in chapters eight and nine show that MacIntyre does not view the Thomistic tradition in particular, or the traditional mode of enquiry in general, as closed, static, or essentially conservative.

c. Dependent Rational Animals

MacIntyre’s Carus Lectures, Dependent Rational Animals: Why Human Beings Need the Virtues (1999), put MacIntyre’s theory of rationality into practice to examine the conditions of human action and to argue that the virtues are essential to the practice of independent practical reason. The book is relentlessly practical; its arguments appeal only to experience and to purposes, and to the logic of practical reasoning.

DRA does not make metaphysical assertions about the human soul, or human dignity, or human rights, or natural law; it treats the human agent as an animal. “Human identity is primarily . . . bodily and therefore animal identity and it is by reference to that identity that the continuities of our relationships to others are partly defined” (DRA, p. 8). Like other intelligent animals, human beings enter life vulnerable, weak, untrained, and unknowing, and face the likelihood of infirmity in sickness and in old age. Like other social animals, humans flourish in groups. We learn to regulate our passions, and to act effectively alone and in concert with others through an education provided within a community. MacIntyre’s position allows him to look to the animal world to find analogies to the role of social relationships in the moral formation of human beings (DRA, pp. 21-28).

In chapter 8, MacIntyre turns to the moral development of the human agent. The task for the human child is to make “the transition from the infantile exercise of animal intelligence to the exercise of independent practical reasoning” (DRA, p. 87). For a child to make this transition is “to redirect and transform her or his desires, and subsequently to direct them consistently towards the goods of different stages of her or his life” (DRA, p. 87). The development of independent practical reason in the human agent requires the moral virtues in at least three ways.

As in his earlier writings, including his MA thesis, DRA presents moral knowledge as a “knowing how,” rather than as a “knowing that.” Knowledge of moral rules is not sufficient for a moral life; prudence is required to enable the agent to apply the rules well. “Knowing how to act virtuously always involves more than rule-following” (DRA, p. 93). The prudent person can judge what must be done in the absence of a rule and can also judge when general norms cannot be applied to particular cases.

Flourishing as an independent practical reasoner requires the virtues in a second way, simply because sometimes we need our friends to tell us who we really are. Independent practical reasoning also requires self-knowledge, but self-knowledge is impossible without the input of others whose judgment provides a reliable touchstone to test our beliefs about ourselves. Self-knowledge therefore requires the virtues that enable an agent to sustain formative relationships and to accept the criticism of trusted friends (DRA, p. 97).

Human flourishing requires the virtues in a third way, by making it possible to participate in social and political action. They enable us to “protect ourselves and others against neglect, defective sympathies, stupidity, acquisitiveness, and malice” (DRA, p. 98) by enabling us to form and sustain social relationships through which we may care for one another in our infirmities, and pursue common goods with and for the other members of our societies.

The book moves from MacIntyre’s assessment of human needs for the virtues to the political implications of that assessment. Social and political institutions that form and enable independent practical reasoning must “satisfy three conditions.” (1) They must enable their members to participate in shared deliberations about the communities’ actions. (2) They must establish norms of justice “consistent with exercise of” the virtue of justice. (3) They must enable the strong “to stand proxy” as advocates for the needs of the weak and the disabled.

The social and political institutions that MacIntyre recommends cannot be identified with the modern nation state or the modern nuclear family. Modern nation states, which MacIntyre characterizes as “giant utility companies” (DRA, p. 132) are organized to provide services, not to pursue a common good. The nuclear family is too small to allow the self-sufficiency required for the political community that pursues a common good (DRA, p. 133-5). The political structures necessary for human flourishing are essentially local. MacIntyre says, “It is . . . a mistake, the communitarian mistake, to attempt to infuse the politics of the state with the values and modes of participation in local community” (DRA, p. 142). Yet local communities support human flourishing only when they actively support “the virtues of just generosity and shared deliberation” (DRA, p. 142). To find examples of the kinds of local communities that support human flourishing, MacIntyre suggests investigations of “fishing communities in New England . . . Welsh mining communities . . . farming cooperatives in Donegal, Mayan towns in Guatemala and Mexico”( DRA, p. 143).

Coming to the conclusion that moral knowledge and understanding develops within, and is partly constituted by social relationships within particular local communities that require their members to commit themselves to the moral narratives and norms of those communities, MacIntyre finds himself compelled to answer what may be called the question of moral provincialism: If one is to seek the truth about morality and justice, it seems necessary to “find a standpoint that is sufficiently external to the evaluative attitudes and practices that are to be put to the question.” If it is impossible for the agent to take such an external standpoint, if the agent’s commitments preclude radical criticism of the virtues of the community, does that leave the agent “a prisoner of shared prejudices” (DRA, p. 154)?

In the final chapter of DRA, MacIntyre argues that it is impossible to find an external standpoint, because rational enquiry is an essentially social work (DRA, p. 156-7). Because it is social, shared rational enquiry requires moral commitment to, and practice of, the virtues to prevent the more complacent members of communities from closing off critical reflection upon “shared politically effective beliefs and concepts” (DRA, p. 161). “Moral commitment to these virtues and to the common good is not an external constraint upon, but a condition of enquiry and criticism” (DRA, p. 162). MacIntyre contrasts this account of social rational enquiry rooted in moral commitment to the standards of a community against Nietzsche’s notion of independence. In the light of the whole argument of DRA, MacIntyre’s conclusion shows, much more clearly than his remarks at the end of AV, why Nietzsche’s ideal of independence provides a poor model and a misleading guide for human flourishing.

d. The Tasks of Philosophy: Selected Essays, Volume 1

In 2006, MacIntyre published two new collections of selected essays. Both volumes include valuable prefaces discussing the origin, importance, and intentions of each of the essays. The first volume, The Tasks of Philosophy, addresses the goals and methods of philosophical enquiry. It opens with EC, and MacIntyre’s remarks in the preface confirm the essay’s place as the starting point of MacIntyre’s mature work. Five more essays in the first part of the book explore the role of culture in our experience of the world, the problem of relativism, the mistake of ignoring the role of history and personal freedom in the development of individual character, the unity of the human person as an embodied mind, and the failure of modern moral philosophy.

The second part of The Tasks of Philosophy, “The Ends of Philosophical Enquiry” discusses the pursuit of truth. Chapter 7, “The Ends of Life, the Ends of Philosophical Writing,” treats philosophy as a professionalized outgrowth of the natural work of plain persons who struggle with ordinary questions about what it means to live well, or how laws have authority, or whether death has meaning (Tasks, p. 125). The literature of philosophy addresses questions like these, but whether philosophy can be fruitful for its reader depends on whether philosophers also engage those questions, or set the questions aside to focus on the literature of philosophy instead.

MacIntyre credits John Stuart Mill and Thomas Aquinas as “two philosophers of the kind who by their writing send us beyond philosophy into immediate encounter with the ends of life” (Tasks, p. 128). From their example, MacIntyre identifies three characteristics of good philosophical writing.

First, both were engaged by questions about the ends of life as questioning human beings and not just as philosophers. . . . Secondly, both Mill and Aquinas understood their speaking and writing as contributing to an ongoing philosophical conversation. . . . Thirdly, it mat