Category Archives: Aesthetics

Music and Social Justice

Protests demanding social justice as the alternative to an unacceptable status quo have been mounted in response to war, political and social inequality, poverty, and other constraints on economic and development opportunities.  Although social justice is typically thought of as a political agenda, many justice movements have used music as a way of inviting and maintaining broad-based participation in their initiatives.

Some of this integration of music and social justice has become so deeply embedded in the identity and culture frameworks of particular groups that it is understood today primarily as culturally constitutive.  For instance, the tradition of the blues is widely recognized as a distinctively African-American contribution to music, but is not always recognized for its role helping to shape the political consciousness of African-American communities emerging from Reconstruction in the nineteenth century and migrating out of the American South in the twentieth century.  The same is true of the interplay between the free jazz of the 1960s and the black-nationalist movement it helped to nurture.  Other moments in music and social justice appear in our social and historical narratives less as integration than as accidental convergences which we do not always notice or remember.  Examples of music dropping out of the politics, rather than politics dropping out of the music, include cultural inattention to the role music has played in later social protests taking place under the banners of the Occupy movement and UK-Uncut, and to the crucial role that music played in the anti-apartheid movement in South Africa.  The paradigm for reciprocity of musical expression and commitment to social justice, on the other hand, is the political protest culture of the United States in the 1960s: the Civil Rights Movement and the anti-Vietnam War movement, in particular.

In his book Rhythm and Resistance, p. 39, Ray Pratt observes that “No music alone can organize one’s ability to invest affectively in the world, [but] one can note powerful contributions of music to temporary emotional states.”  It is because of the way music feeds into our emotional lives and because of the sense of social well-being we get from sharing emotional states with others that music so frequently accompanies movements that build, and depend upon, solidarity.  This is a contingent association, to be sure, but the absence of logical necessity does not diminish the powerful role music plays in our efforts to build a better world.

Table of Contents

  1. Musical Traditions
    1. Origins and Impacts of Blues and Jazz
    2. Folk Music, Rock Music, and Protest Songs
    3. Post-industrial Musical Contestation: Disco, Punk, and Hip-hop
  2. Contemporary Protest
    1. Communal and Community-based Music Making in Democratic States
    2. Building Social Solidarity against Neo-liberalism
    3. Confrontations with Authoritarian Regimes
  3. Academic Attention to Music-Politics Links
    1. Social Aesthetics
    2. Improvisation Theory
    3. Peace through Art
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Musical Traditions

Social transformation effected through music—so-called Peace through Art—is an approach that has been under-theorized.  One of the few theorizers and practitioners who seeks to advance our understanding of social justice through art and music is John Paul Lederach, whose peace-building work focuses on conflict transformation through sonic capacities to promote social healing.  His work with fractured communities emphasizes the restoration of voice, a concept he has found particularly resonant with people who are struggling to repair their violent communities (110, 89).  The music and poetry that can aid in this repair is various and highly contextual; to be meaningful to the community who is seeking social justice, the music that accompanies justice-building must be—or be connected to—an organic part of the community’s everyday life.  In the interest of providing a sense of the sonic diversity of effective musical backdrops, this account of music and social justice is introduced through a discussion of musical types and traditions.

a. Origins and Impacts of Blues and Jazz

One of the most influential historians of the blues is Amiri Baraka who, writing as Leroi Jones in his first book Blues People, explores the African-American experience of the nation through music.  The blues, he explains, is the response of African abductees to their American enslavement, a cultural outpouring developed from work songs and spirituals which represents in microcosm the entire range and nuance of a people’s adaptation to a foreign land they were given no choice but to make into a home.  This history of adaptation Baraka traces is one in which the songs become more complex and more secular, leaving aside the theme of deliverance into heaven that characterized African-American musical production in slavery in favor of a more immediately empowering emphasis on self-determination.  The blues thus functioned as a repository of cultural engagement, its lyrical content evolving over time to reflect whatever social challenges African-American communities were facing at the time.  One notable instance of blues reflecting African-American struggles for respect and legitimacy in the public sphere was the 1941 collaboration between jazz great Count Basie and author Richard Wright (of Native Son fame) on a piece called King Joe (The Joe Louis Blues) that valorized the boxer as the pride of his community at the same moment that anti-lynching campaigns were finally starting to gain traction in the Jim Crow South.

Both Baraka and Albert Murray, another prominent African-American historian of uniquely American music, tell the story of jazz in such a way as to underscore its birth out of the blues.  For Baraka, one of the more coherent ways of defining jazz is as a synthesis of European instrumentation and the African-derived polyrhythms that, fundamentally, are the blues—even as jazz developed its own trajectory.  Murray’s tracing of this history in Stomping the Blues reiterates this common heritage but concentrates so much on jazz and jazz musicians that a reader who comes to his book looking for an analysis of the blues may feel shortchanged.  Yet another treatment of the emergence of the blues and jazz, in Frank Kofsky’s Black Nationalism and the Revolution in Music, tells the story of jazz through a narrative reminiscent of Thomas Kuhn’s Structure of Scientific Revolutions, a story of problem-solving within paradigms that finally, inevitably, break down and must be replaced—as in the case of the shift of musicians like John Coltrane and Ornette Coleman from trying to work their ideas out in bebop to an embrace of free jazz.

Kofsky too endorses the thesis that music and socio-political relations go hand in hand, arguing that we can see in the free jazz that emerged in the early 1960s a kind of “proto-nationalism” which presaged the black nationalist messages of Malcolm X, the Black Panthers, and other “do for self” movements in African-American communities during the 1960s.  These movements stressed the need for community self-sufficiency in the face of a systemically racist white majoritarian society and although the black nationalist (a.k.a. black separatist) message was often simplistically opposed to the integrationism attributed to Martin Luther King and the Civil Rights Movement, their community development efforts—after-school arts programs for children, musical benefits to feed people struggling with food insecurity, “neighborhood watch” security efforts—still stand as tangible models for grassroots solidarity.  The self-sufficiency message Kofsky finds in jazz proto-nationalism is a celebration of a unique African-American aesthetic, one that contested the aesthetic imperialism of the white critics who promoted the value and determined the negotiating power of the mostly black musicians within the system of white-owned recording and performance institutions.  At the height of the free jazz movement, self-sufficiency imperatives were the driving force behind the independent recording facilities and cooperatively owned performance venues with which Coltrane, Coleman, and Charles Mingus, among others, experimented.  They were also a factor in the political stances taken by many of the free jazz musicians—anti-war, anti-colonialism, anti-enslavement, and broadly supportive of the Pan-Africanism that flourished in the wake of African decolonization movements.  Its most enduring legacy, however, was the credence it gave to a counter-narrative about what constituted aesthetic value.  White critics used a theoretical framework developed for Western art music (so-called classical music) to evaluate the originality, authenticity, and artistic complexity of a musical tradition that came out of the African-American experience.  But, as a reading of Kofsky’s history together with Henry Louis Gates Jr.’s literary theory in The Signifying Monkey makes clear, the black musicians immersed in the jazz world were developing their own aesthetic—a conception of, for instance, the value of originality that rejects the Eurocentric ideal of the original (as something that has never before been seen in this world) in favor of an understanding that one makes an original contribution when one adds one’s own perspective to an existing cultural product.  This revision of what originality means implicates the individual empowerment and attention to existing and nascent community networks that black nationalism’s later advocacy of self-sufficiency promoted.

b. Folk Music, Rock Music, and Protest Songs

The protest songs of folk music have a long history of engagement with social justice struggles for abolition of slavery, universal suffrage, and other human rights agendas, but really began to assert their power during the unionization drives emerging out of the industrialization of wealthy societies.  In the United States, some of the most recognizable of these songs that came out of the labor movement include “John Henry” and “Which Side Are You On?”  While folk music developed its reputation as the voice of social justice in America in no small part due to the music of Woody Guthrie, Pete Seeger, and Bob Dylan, perhaps the protest song that has had the most profound effect on American political life is the anti-lynching song “Strange Fruit.”

This song’s lyrics were written Jewish schoolteacher Abel Meeropol (who adopted the orphaned sons of Julius and Ethel Rosenberg, the couple executed in 1953 by the US government on the charge that they passed atomic secrets to the Soviet Union) in the 1930s as a response to a grisly photograph of a lynching.  Recorded by Billie Holiday and performed as one of her signature pieces, “Strange Fruit” became a widely-heard protest against social injustice, a schooling of audiences about the realities of African-American lives (and deaths) in parts of the United States that practiced lynching (“Strange Fruit: The film” Independent Lens).  Jazz critic Leonard Feather once said of “Strange Fruit” that it was “the first significant protest in words and music, the first unmuted cry against racism” (Margolick).  Given the history of African-American activism and oratory, Feather’s claim about its ‘first-ness’ is best parsed as hyperbole, but there is no denying the impact this song had on Holiday’s audiences.  Margolick recounts fights breaking out in nightclubs after it was performed and Billie Holiday herself being attacked by distraught and traumatized patrons.  Despite the emotional toll that singing “Strange Fruit” had on her, Holiday apparently felt a duty to perform it.  “I have to sing it,” Margolick quotes her as saying; “[it] goes a long way in telling how they mistreat Negroes down South.”  And the impact of the song did play a part in efforts at changing social policy: some of the people who endorsed passage of federal anti-lynching laws sent recordings of “Strange Fruit” to members of Congress, presumably because they felt hearing it would produce an awakening of the legislators’ moral outrage.  “Strange Fruit” holds its power, even with the passage of time, and has been called “one of the 10 songs that actually changed the world” (see the November 2003 issue of Q Magazine, a British music magazine).

In the world of rock music—the style that emerged from mainstream white America’s assimilation of rhythm and blues—there is another paradigmatic intersection of music and social justice that can be understood as a rock parallel to folk music’s “Strange Fruit.”  More than forty years ago, Jimi Hendrix and the somewhat thrown-together band that was forming in the wake of the Jimi Hendrix Experience played a two hour set as the final musical act of the Woodstock Festival, a performance most remembered for their improvisation upon the American national anthem, “The Star-Spangled Banner” (Daley 52, 55).  This moment that has come to symbolize the essence of Woodstock was a masterful performance, and critique, of an anthem whose lyrics valorize the resilience of a people under attack.  Shifting between faithful rendition and strategic distortion, Hendrix forcefully shows his audience the moral inconsistency of a nation that sang this song at the same time as it dropped bombs on the people of other nations.  The sounds Hendrix pulls out of the guitar in that iconic performance are reminiscent of explosions and squeals of horror at exactly the points one who is singing along would get to “the rockets’ red glare” and “bombs bursting in air.”  The message that seems to have entered the popular imagination as a result of Hendrix’s improvisation on “The Star-Spangled Banner” at Woodstock is very clearly an anti-war, anti-imperialist one.  In his book Crosstown Traffic, British music journalist Charles Murray concludes that Hendrix’s performance “depicts, as graphically as a piece of music can possibly do, both what the Americans did to the Vietnamese and what they did to themselves” (C. Murray 24; quoted in Daley 57).

c. Post-industrial Musical Contestation: Disco, Punk, and Hip-hop

The music that accompanied industrial decline in Western industrialized nations—notably the United States and the United Kingdom—articulated two distinct responses to the foreclosure of empowerment and idealism that the counterculture of the 1960s had nurtured.  Disco, with its elaborate costumes, exhibitionist focus on dance, and attendant drug culture, represented a turning away from political challenges, a refusal to deal with social problems, and a desire for momentary pleasures.  Punk, on the other hand, was a howl of rage from working class youth who saw, and rejected in no uncertain terms, the hypocrisy of the social establishment and the increasing inaccessibility of economic opportunities for the socio-economically disadvantaged.  Disco was stereotypically identified with African-American performers (albeit predominantly white consumers) whereas punk was typed as a British phenomenon, although, in fact, both musical constituencies could be found in any of the wealthy nations that were starting in the 1970s to wrestle with de-industrialization, wage stagnation, and the corporate restructuring now known as outsourcing.

Elements of both of these musical responses to social marginalization and injustice are synthesized in hip-hop, the most popular musical form for expression of protest worldwide in the following period.  In Black Noise: Rap Music and Black Culture in Contemporary America, sociologist Tricia Rose theorizes the hip-hop universe of her youth as emerging from a post-industrial nightmare in which the ethnic poor were being crowded out of public space, and creative protest was fostered in the effort to reclaim for the people the neighborhoods that were being torn apart to build expressways into the city for affluent suburban commuters (31-33).  Into this unacknowledged war on the poor and the marginalized came the interplay of technology, economics, and culture at the origin of hip-hop, what Rose describes as a practice of appropriating cultural refuse for pleasure (22-23).  Subways, street corners, abandoned parks were occupied by listeners and dancers as political spaces.  The elements of “flow, layering, and rupture” both reflect and contest social marginalization, Rose says; in its origins, the music was both articulating and symbolizing the lived experience of people struggling to hold onto a community identity in the face of “urban development” and gentrification processes (22).  The struggle, she insists, was not a final, futile gesture of victims of urban apocalypse, but was the formation of an alternative, communally-forged identity by producers of a conscious “take back the public spaces” movement (Rose 33).  It was an intransigent, unapologetic assertion of the right of all human beings to take up public space, to interact with each other and with the music that informed these politicized, reclaimed spaces.

2. Contemporary Protest

As noted in the previous section, much of the protest of injustice that is expressed musically in the early 21st century is done so through hip-hop.  There is, for instance, a Hungarian rapper by the name of Dopeman who performs his discontent with the political homogenization of the country’s post-communist regime.  And in Haiti, there was a nationwide rap contest in June 2006, the “Concours Pwojè Lari Pwòp,” in which young people submitted original raps on the topic of cleaning up the environment and the nation voted for their favorite recordings made by twelve finalists—a sort of socially conscious “Haitian Idol” program (Yéle Haiti, 2006).  But the resonance that hip-hop has for youth in many different cultures should not blind us to the diversity of music—traditional and improvised—through which justice appeals speak to people.  For instance, Foucaultian scholar Ladelle McWhorter opens her book Racism and Sexual Oppression in Anglo-America with an anecdote about attending a vigil for Matthew Shepard, the young college student in Wyoming whose 1998 death was an anti-gay hate crime, recalling that some attendees felt inspired to sing the Civil Rights-era anthem “We Shall Overcome” as an expression of their stand against homophobia.  The discussions in this section should therefore be read not as a comprehensive overview, but as a selection of examples that showcase the diversity of musical styles that are speaking justice around the world.

a. Communal and Community-based Music Making in Democratic States

One of the most inspiring instances of music expressing the ethos to which a community aspires can be found in the response of the Norwegian people to the shocking mass murder committed in the summer of 2011 by right-wing extremist Anders Behring Breivik.  To the extent that a motivation has emerged for Breivik’s actions—killing 77 people and wounding 200 more in attacks on government buildings in Oslo and a summer camp on the nearby island of Utoeya—he seems to have been driven by a hatred of the multiculturalism Norway has embraced and by a belief that immigration—Muslim immigration, in particular—has had a contaminating effect on society.  One of the elements of Norwegian multiculturalism that he cited as the object of his hatred was a song that is taught to children in schools, “Children of The Rainbow.”  This song is a Norwegian version of folk singer Pete Seeger’s anti-war song “My Rainbow Race” and it embodies for many Norwegians their shared social commitments to celebrating the diversity of human beings  and to teaching their children a similar appreciation.

One might expect a community that has been devastated by mass-murder to react with rage and calls for harsh punishment for the perpetrator, especially given that many of his victims were young people.  One might also expect heated public debates about gun control and the need for better early diagnosis and intervention in matters of mental health.  What one might not expect to see, but did in fact happen in April 2012, is a gathering of thousands of people in the capital to sing both Norwegian and English versions of the song as a defiant refusal of Breivik’s hate-fueled politics of racial purity.  This community response took place in a public square close to the courthouse in which Breivik was being tried, and some participants spoke of their hope that he could hear their response.  The larger point, though, was to reaffirm the values of peace and love that the song represents, to reaffirm the community’s commitment to each other in the face of efforts to divide them and distance them from their values.

b. Building Social Solidarity against Neo-liberalism

While the Norwegian example demonstrates the expression of shared existing values, music also has considerable constructive power.  It can bind a community or movement which is in the process of being built to the values or ideals that are inspiring the emergent community, a dialectical performance of communities and commitments through music.  One such example is the 2012 student protest movement in the Canadian province of Quebec.  The student protests began in March as demonstrations against an announced hike in tuition fees at the public universities and colleges, an increase of 75% to be phased in over five years, that would have brought Quebec’s historically much lower tuitions into line with those paid by students in the rest of Canada.  This harmonization attempt, apparently reasonable in the eyes of many observers, struck members and representatives of Quebec’s student unions as a violation of the social contract governing the province and a direct assault on their stated goal of low-cost—preferably tuition-free—and accessible post-secondary education.  Students at some Montreal institutions refused to attend classes, going on strike to demand a rollback of the announced increases.  They began marching in the streets, wearing and displaying in apartment windows or on apartment balconies the sign of the protest, the carré rouge (a red square, usually of felt or wool).

They also began making “music,” a discordant but coordinated noise-making that was adapted from Chilean protests against the Pinochet dictatorship.  Every evening at 8pm, people were invited to go out on their balconies and bang pots and pans in a display that was dubbed les casseroles.  The purpose of the noise-making in Chilean protests had been to signal that the population was refusing to live in fear of the dictatorship, but in Quebec the point was to assert membership in the community of those who believe that accessible education is a crucial foundation of social egalitarianism.  Participation in les casseroles was not limited to protesting students; ordinary citizens took part also as a way of demonstrating their solidarity with the student groups in defending Quebec’s noticeably left-wing social consensus.  This sustained protest resulted in an electoral defeat for the premier of the province in September, the historic election of the province’s first female leader, and her announcement that the new government would cancel plans to hike tuition.

c. Confrontations with Authoritarian Regimes

Even when there is no existing or emergent solidarity, there is still a role for music in social protests.  For some time, Russian society has been treated to various improvised musical protests against Vladimir Putin’s extra-democratic election triumphs by an all-female punk band known as “Pussy Riot.”  These young women performed in masks and mini-dresses at politically-inflected sites in Moscow, and recently faced arrest and a high-profile trial for their performances.  They persisted, despite initial warnings, because they have a point to make about the threat to democracy that the Putin oligarchy represents.  Most recently they have been in prison for five months and have been sentenced to a two-year-long prison term in a labor camp as the result of a number of impromptu performances in Moscow, in early spring 2012.  During one such performance, they took over a rooftop in Red Square opposite a prison where dissidents are incarcerated (BBC America, GMT, 28 February 2012).  The most controversial, and the one that has most clearly motivated the charges of “hooliganism,” was a performance in a revered Orthodox church, where they stormed the altar and sang a “punk prayer” that called upon the Virgin Mary to assert herself as a feminist icon and save the nation from Putin.  The incarceration they face for their performances has inspired solidarity protests outside Russian embassies in other countries, and seems to have rattled the oligarchy to the point that Putin himself called for leniency in sentencing on the very charges he insisted be brought against them.  His public call for mercy is widely seen as political theater, however, and the harshness of their sentence is seen by some commentators on Russian public opinion as a possible spur to building a more outspoken opposition to his rule.

3. Academic Attention to Music-Politics Links

For all of the time in which music has played an integral role in movements for social progress, it is only recently that academic theorizing has begun to take notice of these links.  The three major areas of attention to aesthetics-politics overlap are the discourse in social aesthetics (or relational aesthetics) in cultural studies, the broadly interdisciplinary area of improvisation theory, and the “Peace through Art” strand of peace studies.  Not all of the scholars working in these areas look primarily at questions of music, but valuable theoretical insights are being produced.

a. Social Aesthetics

Social aesthetics starts with a consideration of the extent to which one’s membership in community—that is, one’s social identity—shapes one’s approach to art-making and art appreciation.  This approach is exemplified by French sociologist Pierre Bourdieu’s critical rebuttal of Kantian aesthetics on the grounds that “taste” is not a universal trait which identifies a single standard of artistic merit but is instead indexed to one’s class position.  Bourdieu offers a detailed, fine-grained argument for this hypothesis in his 1984 book Distinction, which discusses the results of surveys of respondents from a cross-section of social classes in France of the 1970s.  Contrasting working class, bourgeois, and elite preferences in entertaining, decorating, leisure activities, music, and film, Bourdieu argues that what we find beautiful is indeed demonstrably shaped by our class positions and trajectories.  This reveals aesthetic preferences as socially-inflected, hence political, regardless of how natural they might seem to their bearers.  The net effect of Bourdieu’s intervention is repudiation of a universalist aesthetic hierarchy in which the cultural preferences of the elite class are judged as better than those of the working class, in favor of a relativist indexing of artistic productions to class positions.

While much of the research into musical tastes that explicitly engages the notion of class is being done in the European context, it is not hard to see how this discourse asserts itself in American accounts of taste.  The concepts of “highbrow” music—Western art music, or “classical”—and “lowbrow” music—popular, mass-marketed productions, from jazz in the 1930s to rock in the 1950s through 1980s and, most recently, hip-hop—link tastes to education and income levels, which appear in the American lexicon as stand-ins for the concept of class.  Understanding this linguistic translation makes it possible for us to employ a social aesthetics reading of some of the claims in the history of American musical production that otherwise seem unmotivated.  In particular, John Coltrane’s rejection of the label “jazz” for his music, and his preference for labeling jazz “America’s classical music” can, through this lens, be interpreted as a contestation of the class position to which jazz musicians and their art-making had be relegated.  This contestation does not achieve the relativism of Bourdieu’s inventory, but it does underscore the connection between social identity, or community membership, and aesthetic taste.

b. Improvisation Theory

While much of the work in social aesthetics/relational aesthetics is taking place in the discipline of cultural studies, improvisation theory is asserting itself as a self-consciously interdisciplinary endeavor.  It draws together musicians, musicologists, philosophers, historians, and cultural theorists, among others, to consider questions of how and why improvisation as both a musical and social practice contributes to social organization overall.

Another developing area is the ethics of improvisation.  Tracey Nicholls argues that the examination and adoption of the norms and values that flourish in communities of improvising musicians—those who improvise in the “free jazz” tradition, in particular—can help us to build more responsive, more democratic political societies.  To be part of an improvising ensemble demands an openness to others, a willingness to listen carefully, closely, and charitably, and to respond in constructive ways that advance the musical “conversation.”  This requires capacities for self-trust and respect for others on the part of every participant.  The payoff is an expanded ability to engage difference creatively, instead of through an attitude of fear and hostility, and this in turn leads to a greater ability to deal with the complexity of a fast paced, globalized world.  The ideal actor, in both musical improvisation and the sphere of grassroots popular political action, is the figure Cornel West dubs “the jazz freedom fighter”—an individual who pits his or her creative vision and talents against other members of a group in a way that is both competitive and collaborative.  As West puts it, “individuality is promoted in order to sustain and increase the creative tension with the group—a tension that yields higher levels of performance to achieve the aim of the collective project” (italics in original, 150-151).  In developing our capacities for openness to difference and living with risk (that, for instance, our attempts to negotiate and communicate might fail), this ethics of improvisation grounds subsidiary virtues that are not otherwise encouraged by our social status quo (a way of thinking that teaches us to refrain from taking chances if failure is a live option). Virtues like generosity towards others, willingness to support their risk-taking and their struggles to find creative ways out of impasses, commitment to an enhanced capacity to forgive the mis-steps that inevitably happen in these struggles, and greater respect for the ability to integrate, adopt, or even switch between different perspectives and different types of tools are also encouraged.  This is not to suggest that we should dispense with planning but, given that our best-laid plans may fail, there is an enormous value to developing our individual capacities for improvisatory action.  In this way, improvisation in music points the way to more resilient and more just societies.

c. Peace through Art

Peace through Art, in particular, social transformation effected through music, is an approach to music and social justice that shares  with improvisation theory its inter-disciplinarity.  One of the theorizers and practitioners of peace-building who not only takes seriously the role of art and music, but also seeks to advance our understanding of it, is John Paul Lederach whose peace-building work focuses on conflict transformation through social healing—in particular, the question of “how sonic phenomena might be applied to contexts of social change” (90).  Lederach’s work with fractured communities emphasizes the restoration of voice, a concept he finds particularly resonant with people who are struggling to repair their violent communities (110, 89).  What “voice”—understood both as the individual regaining his or her voice, and the community engaging in meaningful conversation (Lederach 109)—requires is “a container or space within which people [feel] safe but [are] also close enough to hear and receive the echo of each other’s voices” (Lederach 89).

The particular metaphor Lederach favors in his representations of peace processes is one that brings together voice and container: the Tibetan singing bowl.  He observes that social healing, like musical resonance, “does not arise from the individual.  It emerges from the interaction of many vibrations, individual and collective, held within a community context.  In other words, social healing and reconciliation emerge in and around the container that holds collective processes” (Lederach 101).  Elaborating on the bowl metaphor, Lederach points to some of the distinguishing characteristics of the multi-directionality that the bowl shares with sound (94).  The first is circular movement: “[g]oing in circles and repeating them over and again is not,” he insists, “… a movement of going nowhere,” but has instead “a ritualistic quality … creating a certain kind of space and moment” (Lederach 94).  The second is the container itself: “the bowl creates the space or location from which the sound is coaxed and held, but in terms of movement the sensation is one of going deep, made possible by the circling” (Lederach 94).  “Deepening becomes a directional focus of the container,” says Lederach (94). The third directional characteristic that makes the bowl a compelling metaphor is rising: “[s]ound not only seems to rise from the bowl,” he explains; “it expands, moves out, touches and surrounds the space within its reach.  Sound moves in all directions…. sound is multi-directional and non-linear in its movement” and offers the experience of “feelings of being touched and held” (Lederach 94).

Circling, deepening, and rising are all aspects of percussion that make instruments like drums and the singing bowl often function as “the heartbeat” of musical performances.  They are also important aspects of the genuine, voluntary, non-imposed community reconciliation that Lederach prefers to discuss as “conflict transformation.”  Going around, repeating over and over, is a way of gathering grassroots support within a community; each time an outreach effort is made, space is created for community members who had previously not been involved to join the movement.  The descending movement can be understood as a way of describing the process of developing, through a repetition that may well become ritualized, an emotional loyalty to something that starts out as a social commitment—internalizing the peace-building ambition.  And the rising movement can similarly be understood as the inexorable pressure that a fully committed, mobilized grassroots community can exert on a wider population—regional, national, or international—a bending of the discourse to the demands of the grassroots in the same way that the expanding, enveloping musical note arising from the bowl captures the attention of people in the audience who may not have been giving the performance their full attention.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Attali, Jacques. Noise: The Political Economy of Music. Trans. Brian Massumi. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1985.
    • A history of the interplay of music and political life.
  • Baraka, Amiri [Leroi Jones].  Blues People: Negro Music in White America.  New York: Quill/William Morrow, 1999 [1963].
    • A classic text in African-American cultural studies.
  • BBC America.  GMT.  28 February 2012.
    • A television report on Pussy Riot performances.
  • Born, Georgina and David Hesmondhalgh.  Western Music and Its Others: Difference, Representation, and Appropriation in Music.  Berkeley: University of California Press, 2000.
    • A collection of essays on difference and culture-crossing in global musical exchanges.
  • Bourdieu, Pierre.  Distinction: A Social Critique of the Judgement of Taste.  Trans. Richard Nice.  Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1984.
    • A sociological rebuttal of philosophy of art that identifies an attitude of disinterest as the mark of aesthetic appreciation.
  • “Breivik trial: Norwegians rally around peace song.”  BBC News.  26 April 2012.
    • A news report about people’s responses to the trial.
  • Clibbon, Jennifer.  “How a student uprising is reshaping Quebec.”  CBC News.  29 May 2012.
    • An interview with three cultural commentators on the historical context and current significance.
  • Daley, Mike.  “Land of the free.  Jimi Hendrix: Woodstock Festival, August 18, 1969.”  Performance and Popular Music: History, Place and Time.  Ed. Ian Inglis.  Hampshire UK: Ashgate, 2006.  52-57.
    • An essay on how this iconic performance shaped the development of popular music.
  • Gates, Jr., Henry Louis.  The Signifying Monkey: A Theory of African-American Literary Criticism.  New York: Oxford UP, 1988.
    • A scholarly survey of the culturally-distinct communicative practices shaping African-American artistic production.
  • Kofsky, Frank.  Black Nationalism and the Revolution in Music.  New York: Pathfinder, 1970.
    • A history of the free jazz movement of the 1960s and its socio-political commitments.
  • Lederach, John Paul and Angela Jill Lederach.  When Blood and Bones Cry Out: Journeys through the Soundscape of Healing and Reconciliation.  New York: Oxford University Press, 2010.
    • An account of peace-building in conflict zones through local musical traditions.
  • Margolick, David.  “Strange Fruit.”  Vanity Fair Magazine, September 1998.
    • A journalistic account of the history of the Billie Holliday song.
  • Monson, Ingrid.  Saying Something: Jazz Improvisation and Interaction.  Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1996.
    • A musician and music theorist’s account of the transformative effects of music.
  • “Moscou: les trois Pussy Riot condamnées à deux ans de prison chacune.”  métro.  17 August 2012.
    • An Associated Press story in a Montréal free daily newspaper.
  • Murray, Albert.  Stomping The Blues.  Cambridge MA: Da Capo Press, 1976.
    • An analysis of the aesthetic merits of jazz and blues music on their own terms.
  • Nicholls, Tracey.  An Ethics of Improvisation: Aesthetic Possibilities for a Political Future.  Lanham MD: Lexington, 2012.
    • An argument for the transferability of norms shaping improvising musicians’ communities to political communities, and their transformative possibilities.
  • Pratt, Ray.  Rhythm and Resistance: Explorations in the Political Uses of Popular Music.  New York: Praeger, 1990.
    • A study of the political uses of popular music by marginalized communities.
  • Rose, Tricia.  Black Noise: Rap Music and Black Culture in Contemporary America.  Middletown CT: Wesleyan University Press, 1994.
    • An exploration of the history, aesthetics, and political commitments of hip-hop culture, with an emphasis on its musical production.
  • “Strange Fruit.”  Independent Lens.
    • A Public Broadcasting System (PBS) documentary exploring the origins and impact of Billie Holiday’s most famous song.
  • Yéle Haiti Foundation, 2006.
    • The grassroots social rebuilding movement organized by Haitian-American rapper Wyclef Jean.


Author Information

Tracey Nicholls
Lewis University
U. S. A.

Philosophy through Film

This article introduces the main perspectives concerning philosophy through film. Film is understood not so much as an object of philosophical reflection but as a medium for engaging in philosophy. Contributions to the area have flourished since the beginning of the 21st century, along with debates over the extent to which film can really be understood to be “doing” philosophy, as opposed to merely serving as a source of illustration or example for philosophical reflection. A number of objections have their origins in perceived similarities between the cinema and Plato’s cave; other objections have their origins in more general Platonic criticisms of fictive art’s capacity to reveal truth. Against these objections are some surprisingly bold views of film’s capacity to do philosophy, to the effect that much of what can be done in the verbal medium can also be done in the cinematic one; or that there is a distinctive kind of cinematic thinking that resists paraphrasing in traditional philosophical terms. There are also more moderate views, to the effect that film can be seen as engaging in certain recognizably philosophical activities, such as the thought experiment; or that they are able to present certain kinds of philosophical material better than standard philosophical genres. This article considers these views for and against the idea of philosophy through film. It also considers the “imposition” objection—that while film may serve to provide useful illustration, any philosophizing is in fact being done by the philosopher using the film.

Table of Contents

  1. What is Philosophy through Film?
  2. Platonic Objections
    1. Cinema as Plato's Caves
    2. Wartenberg and Thought Experiments
  3. Objections: Smith, Russell
  4. Objecting to the ‘Bold Thesis’
    1. Livingston
    2. Mulhall
    3. Sinnerbrink
    4. Cox and Levine
  5. The Imposition Objection
  6. References and Further Reading

1. What is Philosophy through Film?

This article introduces the main perspectives concerning the idea of doing philosophy through film. By film here is meant, primarily, narrative fiction film. The idea of doing, or at least engaging in some way with, philosophy through film can mean at least two things. Firstly, it may mean using film as a resource, a source of example and illustration, in order to illuminate philosophical positions, ideas and questions. Secondly, it may mean that film itself is to be understood as a medium for philosophising—doing philosophy in film or philosophy as film. The latter implies a more robust engagement of film with philosophy. The extent to which a film can be philosophical or contribute to philosophical knowledge has itself been a matter of some debate. However, what is broadly accepted is that many films ‘resonate in fruitful ways with traditional and contemporary philosophical issues’ (Livingston and Plantinga 2009: xi).

Consideration of film in its philosophical significance, and of philosophical issues through film, can be distinguished from more traditional philosophy of film, though in practice the two activities overlap. Both are subfields in the area of philosophical aesthetics. Philosophy of film traditionally concerns itself with the reflective study of the nature of film, aiming to spell out what film is, whether it is an art, how it differs from other arts, and so on. It is philosophy about film. Contrasted with this is the idea of film serving as a resource, means or medium for the illumination and exploration of philosophical ideas and questions. This is philosophy through film. Historically, philosophy through film is of a more recent vintage than philosophy of film, which enjoyed significant development in the 1980s. Philosophy through film has flourished mostly since 2000, although there were a number of important forerunners who promoted the idea that film can contribute to philosophy, including Cavell (1979), Jarvie (1987), Kupfer (1999) and Freeland (2000).

Since the turn of the century a significant amount of literature has emerged, devoted to the exploration of philosophical themes and questions through narrative films or genres of narrative film. The literature in this area includes more or less popular explorations of the philosophical dimensions of particular films and genres, and of the work of specific directors or writers (for example, Irwin 2002, Abrams 2007, Sanders 2007, Eaton 2008, LaRocca 2011). Along with them there are more pedagogically-oriented introductions to philosophy through film (for example, Litch 2002, Rowlands 2004, Falzon 2007, Cox and Levine 2012). There are also the more theoretical discussions defending the idea of philosophy through film (for example, Mulhall 2002, Wartenberg 2007, Sinnerbrink 2011), or criticising it (for example, Russell 2000, Smith 2006, Livingston 2009).

This article will discuss a range of philosophical positions that have emerged both for and against the idea of philosophy through film. It will proceed by considering a number of objections to the idea.

2. Platonic Objections

The idea of philosophy through film most clearly contrasts with the view that film has nothing to do with philosophy; that film is in effect philosophy’s ‘bad other’, containing all that is foreign or dubious from philosophy’s point of view. Along these lines it might be argued that philosophy is the realm of reflection and debate, whereas film is restricted to experience and action; that philosophy is concerned with reality and truth, as opposed to film which is the realm of mere illusion, appearance, unreal images; or that philosophy deals with universal questions and is a serious business, whereas film is confined to particular narratives, and is designed only for entertainment and distraction. Implicit in the distinctions invoked here is a certain conception of philosophy. As might be expected, considering film to be outside the realm of the philosophical depends on having a certain view of what constitutes philosophy. In general, consideration of the question of philosophy through film inevitably raises meta-philosophical questions about the nature of philosophy itself.

a. Cinema as Plato's Caves

The dismissal of film as inherently non-philosophical is at the heart of what can be called the ‘Platonic’ objection to philosophy through film. Many of the oppositions invoked in distinguishing the philosophical from the non-philosophical - between reflection and experience, reality and illusion, universality and particularity - find articulation in Plato. They can be discerned in Plato’s Allegory of the Cave, in The Republic (514a–520a). The famous story of prisoners mistaking for reality what are in fact mere shadows projected on the cave wall carries the message that visual images and representations are inadequate as a source of knowledge; and more broadly, that philosophical enlightenment requires thinking and critical reflection, rather than reliance on the way things appear to us. There is also an implicit rejection, developed elsewhere by Plato, of the fictive arts, which trade in unreal representations and foster illusion.

Plato’s cave story has a particular resonance for film. The scenario proposed in the cave story is itself uncannily evocative of the modern cinema (within film theory, see for example Baudry 1976), and has been seen as haunting theoretical reflection on film (Stam 2009: 10). On this model, film is a realm of seductive illusion, all too readily confused with reality by the captive audience. This view is evident, amongst other places, in the Marxist or psychoanalytical semiotic theorising that was prominent in the 1960s and 1970s, which holds that narrative films are forms of bourgeois illusionism. Their apparently realistic content is in fact determined by the dominant ideology of the time, and they imprison their audience by inculcating conformist thinking that makes people accepting of their social and political circumstances (Wilson 1986: 12-13; Stam 2009: 138-9). Philosophical insight, it would appear, requires that one look elsewhere.

Against this view, which in its monolithic dismissal of film pays scant attention to what is going on in particular films themselves, is the contention that films can do more than simply echo dominant ideologies that distort and obscure social reality. Careful examination of individual films shows how prevailing ways of thinking, social practices and institutions, can not only be illuminated but also challenged within a cinematic framework, through playfulness, irony, even downright subversion (Wilson 1986: 13; Stam 2009: 139). For example, Ridley Scott’s feminist road movie Thelma and Louise, highlights and mocks various aspects of male power. This implies that film is capable of adopting some kind of reflective attitude towards what it presents, and that it can present narrative scenarios through which such reflective activity can be pursued. If this is so, Plato’s cave scenario is no longer an adequate model for film. Indeed, the very philosophical scenario that encourages one to think critically about what one experiences, to think philosophically, itself appears in various forms in film, with similar effects. For example, Bernardo Bertolucci’s film The Conformist (1970) uses Plato’s cave image to draw attention to the central character’s imprisonment in the delusions of Fascist ideology. As such, the critical reflection on what is given to us, arguably a necessary characteristic of philosophy, is not foreign to film.

b. Wartenberg and Thought Experiments

A second, though once again ultimately Platonic, objection to the idea of philosophy through film is that fiction film only deals in specific narratives, images, and scenarios, whereas philosophy concerns itself with universal truths. How can film, mired in the particular, have anything to do with philosophy? Thomas Wartenberg has developed a conception of philosophy through film that turns this objection on its head. He points out that fictional narratives can be found readily enough in philosophy itself, in the form of imaginary scenarios, hypothetical situations, in short, thought experiments. More than mere ornamentation, thought experiments play a role in arguments, initiating philosophical reflection, raising general questions, questioning existing views by posing counter-examples, exploring what is essential in a concept, confirming a theory or helping build one, and so forth. In other words they are modes of reflection, allowing general points to be made through particular stories (see Wartenberg 2007, 24, 56-65).

Plato’s cave story is itself such a thought experiment, a narrative embodying a memorable image or scenario, designed to raise general questions about the role of sense experience, the nature of knowledge, the character of philosophical enlightenment itself. Ironically enough, Plato resorts to a narrative, embodying a memorable image, in order to argue that images have no place in philosophical discourse; and indeed, he makes use of a narrative that helps to establish a larger narrative in which philosophy itself is seen as arising through the rejection of narrative in favour of a rational discourse devoted to universal truths (Wartenberg 2007: 21; see also Derrida 1993). As it happens, philosophical discourse is filled with such narrative thought experiments; from Plato’s Ring of Gyges to Descartes’ dream or evil demon hypotheses; from Locke’s prince and the cobbler; to Nozick’s experience machine. At the very least, one can say that concrete narratives and scenarios in the form of thought experiments are not foreign to philosophy; and equally, there is no reason why fiction film, which deals with such narratives, should not be able to pursue general points, or raise philosophical questions, through them. Wartenberg argues that it makes sense to think of some fiction films as working in ways that thought experiments do, and to the extent they may be seen as doing philosophy (Wartenberg 2007, 67). For example, Gondry’s 2004 film Eternal Sunshine of the Spotless Mind may be interpreted as a thought experiment that provides a counterexample to the ethical theory of utilitarianism (Wartenberg 2007, 76-93; see also Grau 2006).

It might be added that even within philosophical discourse, many of these experiments have a dramatic and decidedly cinematic quality about them; and film-makers have not been slow in translating them into visual form. For example, by appropriating skeptical thought experiments involving the possibility of global illusion - the cinematic appropriation of Descartes’ dream hypothesis or evil demon thought experiment in various forms, most famously in the Wachowski Brothers’ much discussed 1999 film The Matrix. The capacity of films to explicitly appropriate philosophical material also suggests a further, and comparatively straightforward way in which one might speak of philosophy through film: the film may be about philosophy in various ways. It may be about a philosopher who in the course of the film expounds their views, as in Derek Jarman’s Wittgenstein (1993); or it may have characters who articulate or discuss philosophical positions, such as Eric Rohmer’s Ma Nuit Chez Maud (1969) or Richard Linklater’s Waking Life (2001); or it may be an adaptation of a philosophically interesting text, as in Jean-Jacques Annaud’s The Name of the Rose (1986). However, this in itself only amounts to a recording of particular views and positions, which find expression in the film. It needs to be distinguished from the idea of film as a medium for philosophising, film as philosophy; and doing philosophy in film.

3. Objections: Smith, Russell

A third objection to the idea of philosophy through film can be found in Murray Smith, who argues that film may appropriate or employ philosophically interesting scenarios, but can never really engage with philosophy because it ultimately has very different structuring interests. Whereas philosophy presents thought experiments—narratives in which philosophical concerns, for example, epistemological issues, are at the forefront; in film it is artistic concerns—dramatic or comic ones—that dominate and trump any philosophical concerns (see Smith 2006). In this way film becomes once more the ‘bad other’ of philosophy. Against this it may be argued that it is artificial to acknowledge similarities between film and philosophical texts ‘only to insist that these similarities are subordinate to important differences between them’ (Wartenberg 2007: 16-17). In addition, it may of course be acknowledged that films do much more than simply engage with philosophical questions and concerns, but this does not in itself preclude the possibility that amongst other things, they might do precisely that.

Smith also supplements his argument by reinstating Plato’s denial of the capacity of fictive works to reveal truth. Smith claims that works of art like films are inherently ambiguous, and cannot present the sort of precision that is necessary for articulating and defending philosophical claims (Smith 2006; Wartenberg 2007: 17). A similar claim is made by Bruce Russell, for whom narrative films lack explicitness to the extent that it is not true that there is some particular argument to be found in them; they lack the explicitness necessary for philosophy (Russell 2000; Wartenberg 2007, 19). Against this it can be argued that philosophical claims and arguments attributed to films may not have always been formulated by philosophical interpreters as precisely as they should be, but ‘this does not establish the claim that the films themselves are inherently ambiguous and their arguments incapable of precise formulation’ (Wartenberg 2007: 20).

Here, once again, an a priori dismissal of the idea that film can be philosophical shows itself to be informed by Platonic considerations, in this case Plato’s dismissal of the artists from the city of philosophy. By the same token the notion of philosophy through film amounts to a repudiation of the Platonic prejudice against art, of the view, at least implicit in the cave scenario, that the fictive arts trade in unreal representations and foster illusion, and cannot be philosophically enlightening (see Wartenberg 2007:15,17; Sinnerbrink 2011: 4-5). Philosophy through film may not amount to an entirely anti-Platonic enterprise, however. As with Plato’s repudiation of image and narrative which he nonetheless makes use of in his own work, Plato’s dismissal of the artists is paradoxical, given that, as Iris Murdoch notes, Plato himself is a great artist (Murdoch 1977: 87).

4. Objecting to the ‘Bold Thesis’

a. Livingston

Paisley Livingston argues that film may certainly be used for philosophically interesting purposes, as a resource for philosophy. It can serve to illustrate views about scepticism, wisdom and so on, and even give expression to philosophically informed positions and perspectives. But to do more, to be able to be said to be philosophising, film would have to ‘make independent, innovative and significant contributions to philosophy by means unique to the cinematic medium…where such contributions are independent in the sense that they are inherent in the film, and not based on verbally articulated philosophising’ (Livingston 2008: 12). This is what Livingston calls the ‘bold thesis’ of film as philosophy, the view that films engage in creative philosophical thinking and the formation of new philosophical concepts. Livingston rejects this bold thesis, because either the philosophical content of a film can be paraphrased verbally, in which case it has no special connection with film, or it cannot be paraphrased, in which case one may wonder whether this supposed content exists at all.

b. Mulhall

Against this kind of view, a number of positions have been formulated to the effect that film is more than merely a resource for philosophy, a useful way of illustrating philosophical positions and themes. At one extreme, there is Stephen Mulhall’s classic formulation of film as philosophy, in the introduction to his book on the Alien films:

I do not look to these films as handy or popular illustrations of views and arguments properly developed by philosophers; I see them rather as themselves reflecting on and evaluating such views and arguments, as thinking seriously and systematically about them in just the same ways that philosophers do. Such films are not philosophy’s raw material, are not a source for its ornamentation; they are philosophical exercises, philosophy in action – film as philosophising (Mulhall 2002: 2).

This formulation implies that there can be a cinematic performance of philosophy—that what is done in the verbal medium of philosophy can also be done in the cinematic medium. However, by the same token it might be argued that on this view, everything done cinematically could also be done in purely verbal philosophical form; it could be entirely paraphrased, or re-expressed in verbal terms. The problem with this conception of philosophy through film is that film here may no longer be philosophy’s ‘bad other’, but in so far as it can be said to philosophize, it seems to have been effectively reduced to philosophy. On this conception, film as a philosophical exercise is too similar to philosophy to be doing anything distinctively cinematic; which also means that it presumably could be dispensed with in favour of purely verbal philosophical argument without any loss. The cinematic setting for this reflective activity is purely accidental. As such, philosophy through film simply turns out to be more philosophy.

c. Sinnerbrink

At the other extreme, Robert Sinnerbrink argues that films are able to engage in a distinctively cinematic kind of thinking that resists philosophical translation or paraphrase. Such films cannot be reduced to a philosophical thesis or theoretical problem, or translated into a ready-made position or argument; they confront existing categories and open up new ways of thinking (Sinnerbrink 2011:10). By concretely showing rather than arguing, these films question aspects of our practices or normative frameworks, challenge established ways of seeing, disclose new aspects of experience, and open up new paths of thinking (Sinnerbrink, 2011: 141, 142). Thus, for example, rather than exploring scenarios of global illusion that draw attention to a distinction between appearance and underlying reality, a film like David Lynch’s Mulholland Drive (2001) can be seen as bringing into question the very distinction between the real and the illusory, in order to explore an indeterminate zone between fantasy and reality (see Sinnerbrink 2005).

By the same token, however, it might be argued that the more distinctively cinematic the reflection, that is, the more it resists translation into a philosophical thesis or form, the less recognisably philosophical it is going to be. In other words, the less it will constitute philosophy through film. Whereas in Mulhall’s formulation, filmic reflection was too similar to philosophy to do anything distinctively cinematic; now filmic reflection is too different from philosophy to do anything recognisably philosophical. In a sense this view does not oppose Livingston’s rejection of the bold thesis regarding philosophy through film—not only because there cannot be a uniquely cinematic form of reflection, but because to the extent that there is, it is no longer philosophical. In this form, film would be philosophy’s ‘good other’. It would embody a form of thinking or of reflection—something other than philosophy. Film, so understood, would neither be a mere resource or instrument for philosophy, nor a form of reflection that could be translated into existing philosophical categories. Rather, it would be an autonomous mode of reflection that transcends philosophy. Here, one would be escaping from philosophy through film; though it might also be argued that this represents the transformation of philosophical reflection into something new.

d. Cox and Levine

Finally, a ‘moderate’ position, standing effectively between those of Mulhall and Sinnerbrink, which acknowledges both the philosophical and the necessarily cinematic character of cinematic thinking, is argued for by Damien Cox and Michael Levine. This is the view that films are capable of performing philosophical activities that can also be pursued in standard verbal philosophical form, but they can sometimes do some things better than written texts can. That is, precisely as films, they are capable of presenting certain kinds of philosophical material better than standard philosophical genres. This dovetails with the view developed by Wartenberg, discussed earlier, that film is able to explore philosophical issues and questions through concrete thought experiments. What Cox and Levine argue is that cinematic thought experiments can be presented with greater richness, nuance and perspective than may be found within the genres of professional philosophy (the book, the journal article), where these experiments are typically abstract, thin and context-free (Cox and Levine 201: 10-12).

This position joins with those critiques of philosophy to the effect that the peculiar abstractness of standard philosophical genres can be a source of distortion, and which argue that some areas of philosophy, like ethics, are sometimes more at home in literature and the arts (Cox and Levine 2012: 11-12; see Murdoch 1970, 1977; Nussbaum 1990). Clearly evident once again, in this affirmation of art in general and film in particular, is the rejection of the Platonic view that the fictive arts, trading in unreal representations only foster illusion, and have nothing to contribute to philosophy.

5. The Imposition Objection

The idea of philosophy through film, then, can cover a number of things, including: using film as a resource, providing useful examples and illustrations of philosophical ideas; and the idea of film as philosophizing, at least in the sense of evoking or enacting philosophically interesting thought experiments that remind us of various aspects of our concrete experience of life. In addition, it can cover the idea of film as being explicitly about philosophers or philosophy, giving explicit expression to philosophical positions and perspectives.

This brings us to one more possible objection to the idea of philosophy through film, in particular film as doing philosophy, namely, what has been termed by Wartenberg the imposition objection. This is the claim that film may certainly be used for philosophically interesting purposes, such as providing useful illustrations, but that any philosophizing is done by the philosopher using the film, rather than by the film itself. On this view, to think that the film itself is doing anything philosophical is a mistake; any philosophical significance one imagines to be discernible in the film itself is in fact only a projection of the philosopher’s views onto the film. A film may raise interesting questions, but only a philosophical interpreter can organize those into a coherent position or argument (Wartenberg 2007: 25). This view in effect requires that film be once again viewed as the ‘bad other’ of philosophy, with any philosophical significance necessarily being imposed from outside. At best, we are back with the view that film may serve as a useful resource for philosophy, a source of example and illustration, but that it cannot be said in any way to do philosophy.

Obviously, to the extent that film can be said to do philosophy, the imposition view has to be rejected. A general point to make here is that any engagement with film requires interpretation on the part of the onlooker, who is, after all, at the most basic level, required to organise and make sense of a multiplicity of images in a certain way. Engagement with film in its philosophical aspects is no different; it requires a certain reading or interpretation of the film on the part of the onlooker. At the very least, engaging with the philosophical dimension of a film involves singling out a particular aspect of that film and ignoring others, since there is always much more going on in a film than a concern with philosophically relevant matters. As far as responding to the imposition objection is concerned, the important issue is not whether there is interpretation but whether or not the interpretation, the philosophical reading, is imposed on the film; that is, whether it is appropriate or inappropriate to the film. With regard to what renders an interpretation appropriate, both author and audience -centred positions have been argued for in the literature. These alternatives recall broader debates in aesthetics and literary theory over how far a work of art is to be judged by reference to the purposes of its creator, and to what extent a text may yield more than the creator of the work could have conceived.

On the one hand there is the ‘author-centred’ view argued for by Wartenberg, that a philosophical interpretation of a film may be considered appropriate because it is grounded in the intentions of the authors of the film (Wartenberg 2007: 26). That is, it is necessary that the film’s creators intend to present the views or pose the questions that are being attributed to the film. As a result there are constraints as to what interpretations may be made. Specifically, one should never attribute to the film a meaning that could not be intended by the creator of that work. For a philosophical film interpretation to be plausible, it needs to posit a meaning the filmmaker at least could have intended. To that extent, the meaning discerned is not simply imposed or projected onto the film, but rather is inherent in the film, as part of its creators’ intention. Certainly, the filmmaker may not necessarily have an explicit conception of the philosophical views that are embedded in the film; but it is enough that they have some conception of the relevant idea, and what might be questionable about it. (Wartenberg 2007: 26, 91). A problem with the ‘author-centred’ view is that it may be difficult or impossible to establish what the director’s or writer’s intention might have been; and moreover, since films are collaborative endeavours it may not be possible even to identify a particular author.

On the other hand, there is the view that the philosophical views and questions presented in films can be assessed independently of authorial intention. For Cox and Levine, ‘[A]n interesting aspect of film, like other forms of narrative art (such as novels) is that it often lets us see and surmise a great deal more than its creators intended’ (Cox and Levine 2012: 13). In this spirit they argue that philosophical views may be embedded in a film without it being the director’s or writer’s intention that the view be manifest, or without them even being aware that it is a view they hold. That is, ‘it is often possible to distinguish authorial intention from what is revealed in film narrative, visual effect, or performance.’ (Cox and Levine 2012: 14-15) Here, the emphasis changes from a concern with the author’s intentions to how the film is received—an audience-centred interpretation. Films have ‘lives and meanings of their own,’ and these will vary over time and are relative to a degree to particular audiences (Cox and Levine 2012: 15).

What these views have in common is that they acknowledge that engagement with a film involves some interpretation on the part of the onlooker; but also that this interpretation is not arbitrary, such that one could read any kind of significance whatsoever into the film. That would indeed imply that any philosophical significance is simply being imposed on the film from outside. However, even an audience-centred interpretation is subject to constraints arising from the film itself. Not any kind of interpretation is appropriate; some interpretations work better than others. This is so even if one views the film merely as providing a handy illustration of a pre-existing philosophical position or issue, where the film is being used as a resource for philosophical purposes, and the concern is primarily to illuminate certain philosophical ideas. Even here the interpretation is not arbitrary. There are better or worse cinematic illustrations that one can appeal to; More or less effective cinematic resources one can make use of. Some films lend themselves more readily to the task than others; and to the extent that they do so, being able to make use of the film in this way is also saying something about the film itself, and reflects the reality of the film itself in so far as it engages with philosophical ideas. For example, one sees philosophical ideas like Locke’s memory-based conception of personal identity concretely illustrated in a film like Paul Verhoeven’s Total Recall (1990); the film also invites this interpretation, and thereby reveals itself to have strong philosophical resonances.

Furthermore, if film even as illustration can be said to be engaging with philosophy, it seems to follow that a sharp distinction cannot really be drawn between film as illustration for philosophy, and as doing philosophy. It would instead be a matter of degrees of engagement, of film being more or less engaged with philosophical positions, issues and questions. By the same token, if film does indeed have a capacity to do philosophy, in particular by presenting certain philosophical material with greater richness, nuance and perspective than is possible within the genres of professional philosophy, we would expect something of this to also be present in film as mere illustration. Certainly, Wartenberg has argued to this effect, that films which illustrate previously articulated philosophical positions can, despite their status as illustrations, deepen understanding of those positions by providing a concrete version of an abstract theory, and to that extent they can be said to embody philosophical thinking. For example, Charlie Chaplin’s Modern Times (1936) can be seen as offering a concrete illustration of Marx’s conception of the alienating mechanisation of human beings under the factory system, a concrete representation of an abstract account that clarifies and extends it, and shows its human significance (Wartenberg 2007: 32, 44-54).

Finally, if film even as illustration engages with philosophy, and there is no sharp distinction between film as illustration, and film as doing philosophy; it will no longer be possible to accept the former while rejecting the latter. The imposition objection allows that film may be used for illustration, but rejects the idea of film as philosophising, dismissing this as no more than a projection on the part of the onlooker. However, without a sharp distinction between the two, it is not possible to accept the former while rejecting the latter. Or to put it in more positive terms, accepting the former implicates one in the latter because far from being mere illustration, film as illustration can already be said, to an extent, to be doing philosophy.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Abrams, Jerold J. 2007. The Philosophy of Stanley Kubrick. Lexington: The University Press of Kentucky.
  • Baudry, Jean-Louis. 1976. ‘The Apparatus’, Camera Obscura. Fall 1976 1(11), 104-12.
  • Cavell, Stanley. 1979. The World Viewed: Reflections on the Ontology of Film, enlarged edition. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Cox, Damien and Michael P. Levine. 2012. Thinking Through Film: Doing Philosophy, Watching Movies. Malden, Wiley-Blackwell
  • Derrida, Jacques. 1993. ‘Circumfession’, In J. Derrida & G. Bennington, Jacques Derrida (pp. 3–315). Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.
  • Eaton, A.W. (ed.) 2008. Talk to Her, London/New York, Routledge.
  • Falzon, Christopher. 2007. Philosophy Goes to the Movies: an Introduction to Philosophy. London/New York, Routledge.
  • Freeland, Cynthia. 2000. The Naked and the Undead: Evil and the Appeal of Horror, Boulder: Westview Press.
  • Grau, Christopher. 2006. ‘Eternal Sunshine of the Spotless Mind and the Morality of Memory’, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 64 (1):119–133.
  • Irwin, William (ed.) 2002. The Matrix and Philosophy: Welcome to the Desert of the Real. Chicago: Open Court.
  • Jarvie, Ian. 1987. Philosophy of the Film: Epistemology, Ontology, Aesthetics. New York/London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • Kupfer, Joseph H. 1999. Visions of Virtue in Popular Film. Boulder: Westview Press.
  • LaRocca, David (ed.) 2011. The Philosophy of Charlie Kaufman. Lexington: The University Press of Kentucky.
  • Litch, Mary. 2002. Philosophy through Film. New York: Routledge
  • Livingston, Paisley. 2006. ‘Theses on Cinema as Philosophy’, in Murray Smith and Thomas E. Wartenberg. 2006. Thinking Through Cinema: Film as Philosophy. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Livingston, Paisley and Carl Plantinga (eds) 2009. ‘Preface’ to The Routledge Companion to Philosophy and Film. London/New York, Routledge.
  • Mulhall, Stephen. 2002. On Film. London: Routledge.
  • Murdoch, Iris. 1970. The Sovereignty of Good. Boston: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • Murdoch, Iris. 1977. The Fire and the Sun: Why Plato Banished the Artists. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Nussbaum, Martha. 1990. Love’s Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press
  • Read, Rupert and Jerry Goodenough (eds) 2005. Film as Philosophy: Essays on Cinema after Wittgenstein and Cavell. London: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Rowland, Mark. 2004. The Philosopher at the End of the Universe. New York: Thomas Dunne Books .
  • Russell, Bruce. 2000. ‘The Philosophical Limits of Film’, Film and Philosophy. Special Issue on Woody Allen, 163-67.
  • Sanders, Steven M. 2007. The Philosophy of Science Fiction Film. Lexington: The University Press of Kentucky.
  • Sinnerbrink, Robert. 2005. ‘Cinematic Ideas: David Lynch's Mulholland Drive’, Film-Philosophy 9 (34).
  • Sinnerbrink, Robert. 2011. New Philosophies of Film: Thinking Images. London and New York: Continuum.
  • Smith, Murray ‘Film Art, Argument and Ambiguity’. 2006, in Murray Smith and Thomas E. Wartenberg (eds). 2006. Thinking Through Cinema: Film as Philosophy. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Stam, Robert. 2000. Film Theory: An Introduction. Malden: Blackwell.
  • Wartenberg, Thomas. 2007. Thinking on Screen: Film as Philosophy. New York/London, Routledge.
  • Wilson, George. 1986. Narration in Light: Studies in Cinematic Point of View. Baltimore/London: The Johns Hopkins University Press.

Author Information

Christopher Falzon
University of Newcastle

Aesthetic Formalism

artistic imageFormalism in aesthetics has traditionally been taken to refer to the view in the philosophy of art that the properties in virtue of which an artwork is an artwork—and in virtue of which its value is determined—are formal in the sense of being accessible by direct sensation (typically sight or hearing) alone.

While such Formalist intuitions have a long history, prominent anti-Formalist arguments towards the end of the twentieth century (for example, from Arthur Danto and Kendall Walton according to which none of the aesthetic properties of a work of art are purely formal) have been taken by many to be decisive. Yet in the early twenty-first century there has been a renewed interest in and defense of Formalism. Contemporary discussion has revealed both “extreme” and more “moderate” positions, but the most notable departure from traditional accounts is the move from Artistic to Aesthetic Formalism.

One might more accurately summarize contemporary Formalist thinking by noting the complaint that prominent anti-Formalist arguments fail to accommodate an important aspect of our aesthetic lives, namely those judgements and experiences (in relation to art, but also beyond the art-world) which should legitimately be referred to as “aesthetic” but which are accessible by direct sensation, and proceed independently of one’s knowledge or appreciation of a thing’s function, history, or context.

The presentation below is divided into five parts. Part 1 outlines an historical overview. It considers some prominent antecedents to Formalist thinking in the nineteenth century, reviews twentieth century reception (including the anti-Formalist arguments that emerged in the latter part of this period), before closing with a brief outline of the main components of the twenty-first century Formalist revival. Part 2 returns to the early part of the twentieth century for a more in-depth exploration of one influential characterisation and defense of Artistic Formalism developed by art-critic Clive Bell in his book Art (1913). Critical reception of Bell’s Formalism has been largely unsympathetic, and some of the more prominent concerns with this view will be discussed here before turning—in Part 3—to the Moderate Aesthetic Formalism developed in the early part of the twenty-first century by Nick Zangwill in his The Metaphysics of Beauty (2001). Part 4 considers the application of Formalist thinking beyond the art world by considering Zangwill’s responses to anti-Formalist arguments regarding the aesthetic appreciation of nature. The presentation closes with a brief conclusion (Part 5) together with references and suggested further reading.

Table of Contents

  1. A Brief History of Formalism
    1. Nineteenth Century Antecedents
    2. Twentieth Century Reception
  2. Clive Bell’s Artistic Formalism
    1. Clive Bell and ‘Significant Form’
    2. The Pursuit of Lasting Values
    3. Aesthetic versus Non-Aesthetic Appreciation
    4. Conclusions: From Artistic to (Moderate) Aesthetic Formalism
  3. Nick Zangwill’s Moderate Aesthetic Formalism
    1. Extreme Formalism, Moderate Formalism, Anti-Formalism
    2. Responding to Kendall Walton’s Anti-Formalism
    3. Kant’s Formalism
  4. From Art to the Aesthetic Appreciation of Nature
    1. Anti-Formalism and Nature
    2. Formalism and Nature.
  5. Conclusions
  6. References and Further Reading

1. A Brief History of Formalism

a. Nineteenth Century Antecedents

When A. G. Baumgarten introduced the term “aesthetic” into the philosophy of art it seemed to be taken up with the aim of recognising, as well as unifying, certain practices, and perhaps even the concept of beauty itself. It is of note that the phrase l’art pour l’art seemed to gain significance at roughly the same time that the term aesthetic came into wider use.

Much has been done in recognition of the emergence and consolidation of the l’art pour l’art movement which, as well as denoting a self-conscious rebellion against Victorian moralism, has been variously associated with bohemianism and Romanticism and characterises a contention that, for some, encapsulates a central position on art for the main part of the nineteenth century. First appearing in Benjamin Constant’s Journal intime as early as 1804 under a description of Schiller’s aesthetics, the initial statement: “L’art pour l’art without purpose, for all purpose perverts art” has been taken not only as a synonym for the disinterestedness reminiscent of Immanuel Kant’s aesthetic but as a modus operandi in its own right for a particular evaluative framework and corresponding practice of those wishing to produce and insomuch define the boundaries of artistic procedure.

These two interpretations are related insofar as it is suggested that the emergence of this consolidated school of thought takes its initial airings from a superficial misreading of Kant’s Critique of Judgement (a connection we will return to in Part 3). Kant’s Critique was not translated into French until 1846, long after a number of allusions that implicate an understanding and certainly a derivation from Kant’s work. John Wilcox (1953) describes how early proponents, such as Victor Cousin, spoke and wrote vicariously of Kant’s work or espoused positions whose Kantian credentials can be—somewhat undeservedly it turns out—implicated. The result was that anyone interested in the arts in the early part of the nineteenth century would be exposed to a new aesthetic doctrine whose currency involved variations on terms including aesthetic, disinterest, free, beauty, form and sublime.

By the 1830s, a new school of aesthetics thus accessed the diluted Kantian notions of artistic genius giving form to the formless, presented in Scheller’s aesthetics, via the notion of beauty as disinterested sensual pleasure, found in Cousin and his followers, towards an understanding of a disinterested emotion which constitutes the apprehension of beauty. All or any of which could be referred to by the expression L’art pour l’art; all of which became increasingly associated with the term aesthetic.

Notable adoption, and thus identification with what may legitimately be referred to as this “school of thought” included Victor Hugo, whose preface to Cromwell, in 1827, went on to constitute a manifesto for the French Romantic movement and certainly gave support to the intuitions at issue. Théophile Gautier, recognising a theme in Hugo, promoted a pure art-form less constrained by religious, social or political authority. In the preface to his Premières poesies (1832) he writes: "What [end] does this [book] serve? - it serves by being beautiful… In general as soon as something becomes useful it ceases to be beautiful". This conflict between social usefulness versus pure art also gained, on the side of the latter, an association with Walter Pater whose influence on the English Aesthetic movement blossomed during the 1880s where the adoption of sentimental archaism as the ideal of beauty was carried to extravagant lengths. Here associations were forged with the likes of Oscar Wilde and Arthur Symons, further securing (though not necessarily promoting) a connection with aestheticism in general. Such recognition would see the influence of l’art pour l’art stretch well beyond the second half of the nineteenth century.

As should be clear from this brief outline it is not at all easy, nor would it be appropriate, to suggest the emergence of a strictly unified school of thought. There are at least two strands that can be separated in what has been stated so far. At one extreme we can identify claims like the following from the preface of Wilde’s The Picture of Dorian Gray: “There is no such thing as a moral or an immoral book. Books are well written or badly written.” Here the emphasis is initially on the separation of the value of art from social or moral aims and values. The sentiment is clearly reminiscent of Gautier’s claim: “Only those things that are altogether useless can be truly beautiful; anything that is useful is ugly; for it is the expression of some need…”. Yet for Wilde, and many others, the claim was taken more specifically to legitimise the production and value of amoral, or at least morally controversial, works.

In a slightly different direction (although recognisably local to the above), one might cite James Whistler: Art should be independent of all claptrap—should stand alone […] and appeal to the artistic sense of eye or ear, without confounding this with emotions entirely foreign to it, in devotion, pity, love, patriotism and the like.

While the second half of this statement seems merely to echo the sentiments expressed by Wilde in the same year, there is, in the first half, recognition of the contention Whistler was later to voice with regard to his painting; one that expressed a focus, foremost, on the arrangement of line, form and colour in the work. Here we see an element of l’art pour l’art that anticipated the importance of formal features in the twentieth century, holding that artworks contain all the requisite value inherently—they do not need to borrow significance from biographical, historical, psychological or sociological sources. This line of thought was pursued, and can be identified, in Eduard Hanslick’s The Beautiful in Music (1891); Clive Bell’s Art (1913); and Roger Fry’s Vision and Design (1920). The ruminations of which are taken to have given justification to various art movements from abstract, non-representational art, through Dada, Surrealism, Cubism.

While marked here as two separable strands, a common contention can be seen to run through the above intuitions; one which embarks from, but preserves, something of the aesthetic concept of disinterestedness, which Kant expressed as purposiveness without purpose. L’art pour l’art can be seen to encapsulate a movement that swept through Paris and England in the form of the new Aesthetic (merging along the way with the Romantic Movement and bohemianism), but also the central doctrine that formed not only the movement itself, but a well-established tradition in the history of aesthetics. L’art pour l’art captures not just a movement but an aesthetic theory; one that was adopted and defended by both critics and artists as they shaped art history itself.

b. Twentieth Century Reception

Towards the end of the twentieth century Leonard Meyer (in Dutton, 1983) characterised the intuition that we should judge works of art on the basis of their intrinsic formal qualities alone as a “common contention” according to which the work of art is said to have its complete meaning “within itself”. On this view, cultural and stylistic history, and the genesis of the artwork itself do not enhance true understanding. Meyer even suggests that the separation of the aesthetic from religion, politics, science and so forth, was anticipated (although not clearly distinguished) in Greek thought. It has long been recognised that aesthetic behaviour is different from ordinary behaviour; however, Meyer goes on to argue that this distinction has been taken too far. Citing the Artistic Formalism associated with Clive Bell (see Part 2), he concludes that in actual practice we do not judge works of art in terms of their intrinsic formal qualities alone.

However, Artistic Formalism, or its close relatives, have met with serious (or potentially disabling) opposition of the kind found in Meyer. Gregory Currie (1989) and David Davies (2004) both illustrate a similar disparity between our actual critical and appreciative practices and what is (in the end) suggested to be merely some pre-theoretical intuition. Making such a point in his An Ontology of Art, Currie draws together a number of familiar and related aesthetic stances under the term “Aesthetic Empiricism”, according to which

[T]he boundaries of the aesthetic are set by the boundaries of vision, hearing or verbal understanding, depending on which art form is in question. (Currie, 1989, p.18)

Currie asserts that empiricism finds its natural expression in aesthetics in the view that a work—a painting, for instance—is a “sensory surface”. Such a view was, according to Currie, supposed by David Prall when he said that “Cotton will suffice aesthetically for snow, provided that at our distance from it it appears snowy”. It is the assumption we recover from Monroe Beardsley (1958) in the view that the limits of musical appreciation are the limits of what can be heard in a work. Currie also recognises a comparable commitment concerning literature in Wimsatt and Beardsley’s The Intentional Fallacy (1946).  We can add to Currie’s list Clive Bell’s claim that

To appreciate a work of art we need bring with us nothing from life, no knowledge of its ideas and affairs, no familiarity with its emotions… we need bring with us nothing but a sense of form and colour and a knowledge of three-dimensional space.

Alfred Lessing, in his “What is Wrong with Forgery?” (in Dutton, 1983), argues that on the assumption that an artwork is a “sensory surface” it does seem a natural extension to claim that what is aesthetically valuable in a painting is a function solely of how it looks. This “surface” terminology, again, relates back to Prall who characterised the aesthetic in terms of an exclusive interest in the “surface” of things, or the thing as seen, heard, felt, immediately experienced. It echoes Fry’s claim that aesthetic interest is constituted only by an awareness of “order and variety in the sensuous plane”. However, like Kendall Walton (1970) and Arthur Danto (1981) before him, Currie’s conclusion is that this common and influential view is nonetheless false.

Walton’s anti-formalism is presented in his essay “Categories of Art” in which he first argues that the aesthetic properties one perceives an artwork as having will depend on which category one perceives the work as belonging to (for example, objects protruding from a canvas seen under the category of “painting”—rather than under the category of “collage”—may appear contrary to expectation and thus surprising, disturbing, or incongruous). Secondly, Walton argues that the aesthetic properties an artwork actually has are those it is perceived as having when seen under the category to which it actually belongs. Determination of “correct” categories requires appeal to such things as artistic intentions, and as knowledge concerning these requires more than a sense of form, color, and knowledge of three-dimensional space, it follows that Artistic Formalism must be false (see Part 3 for a more in-depth discussion of Walton’s anti-formalist arguments).

Similarly, Danto’s examples—these include artworks such as Marcel Duchamp’s “Readymades”, Andy Warhol’s Brillo Boxes, and Danto’s hypothetical set of indiscernible red squares that constitute distinct artworks with distinct aesthetic properties (indeed, two of which are not artworks at all but “mere things”)are generally taken to provide insurmountable difficulties for traditional Artistic Formalism. Danto argues that, regarding most artworks, it is possible to imagine two objects that are formally or perceptually indistinguishable but differ in artistic value, or perhaps are not artworks at all.

Despite the prominence of these anti-formalist arguments, there has been some notable resistance from the Formalist camp. In 1983 Denis Dutton published a collection of articles on forgery and the philosophy of art under the title The Forger’s Art. Here, in an article written for the collection, Jack Meiland argues that the value of originality in art is not an aesthetic value. In criticism of the (above) position held by Leonard Meyer, who defends the value of originality in artworks, Meiland asks whether the original Rembrandt has greater aesthetic value than the copy? He refers to “the appearance theory of aesthetic value” according to which aesthetic value is independent of the non-visual properties of the work of art, such as its historical properties. On this view, Meiland argues, the copy, being visually indistinguishable from the original, is equal in aesthetic value. Indeed, he points to an arguable equivocation in the sense of the word “original” or “originality”. The originality of the work will be preserved in the copy—it is rather the level of creativity that may be surrendered. We might indeed take the latter to devalue the copied work, but Meiland argues that while originality is a feature of a work, creativity is a feature applicable to the artist or in this case a feature lacking in the copyist, it therefore cannot affect the aesthetic quality of the work. Thus we cannot infer from the lack of creativity on the part of the artist that the work itself lacks originality.

This distinction between “artistic” and “aesthetic” value marks the transition from Artistic to Aesthetic Formalism. Danto, for example, actually endorsed a version of the latter in maintaining that (while indistinguishable objects may differ in terms of their artistic value or art-status) in being perceptually indiscernible, two objects would be aesthetically indiscernible also. Hence, at its strongest formulation Aesthetic Formalism distinguishes aesthetic from non-aesthetic value whilst maintaining that the former is restricted to those values that can be detected merely by attending to what can be seen, heard, or immediately experienced. Values not discerned in this way may be important, but should not be thought of as (purely) “aesthetic” values.

Nick Zangwill (2001) has developed a more moderate Aesthetic Formalism, drawing on the Kantian distinction between free (formal) and dependent (non-formal) beauty. In relation to the value of art, Zangwill accepts that “extreme formalism (according to which all the aesthetic properties of a work of art are formal) is false. But so too are strongly anti-Formalist positions such as those attributable to Walton, Danto, and Currie (according to which none of the aesthetic properties of a work of art are purely formal). Whilst conceding that the restrictions imposed by Formalism on those features of an artwork available for consideration are insufficient to deliver some aesthetic judgements that are taken to be central to the discourse, Zangwill maintains that there is nonetheless an “important truth” in formalism. Many artworks have a mix of formal and non-formal aesthetic properties, and at least some artworks have only formal aesthetic properties. Moreover, this insight from the Aesthetic Formalisist is not restricted to the art world. Many non-art objects also have important formal aesthetic properties. Zangwill even goes so far as to endorse extreme Aesthetic Formalism about inorganic natural items (such as rocks and sunsets).

2. Clive Bell’s Artistic Formalism

In Part 1 we noted the translation of the L’art pour l’art stance onto pictorial art with reference to Whistler’s appeal to “the artistic sense of eye and ear”.  Many of the accounts referred to above focus on pictorial artworks and the specific response that can be elicited by these. Here in particular it might be thought that Bell’s Artistic Formalism offers a position that theoretically consolidates the attitudes described.

Formalism of this kind has received largely unsympathetic treatment for its estimation that perceptual experience of line and colour is uniquely and properly the domain of the aesthetic. Yet there is some intuitive plausibility to elements of the view Bell describes which have been preserved in subsequent attempts to re-invigorate an interest in the application of formalism to aesthetics (see Part 3). In this section we consider Bell’s initial formulation, identifying (along the way) those themes that re-emerge in contemporary discussion.

a. Clive Bell and ‘Significant Form’

The claim under consideration is that in pictorial art (if we may narrow the scope for the purposes of this discussion) a work’s value is a function of its beauty and beauty is to be found in the formal qualities and arrangement of paint on canvas. Nothing more is required to judge the value of a work. Here is Bell:

What quality is shared by all objects that provoke our aesthetic emotions? What quality is common to Sta. Sophia and the windows at Chartres, Mexican sculpture, a Persian bowl, Chinese carpets, Giotto’s frescoes at Padua, and the masterpieces of Poussin, Piero della Francesca, and Cezanne? Only one answer seems possible - significant form. In each, lines and colours combined in a particular way, certain forms and relations of forms, stir our aesthetic emotions. These relations and combinations of lines and colours, these aesthetically moving forms, I call "Significant Form"; and "Significant Form" is the one quality common to all works of visual art. (1913, p.5)

These lines have been taken to summarise Bell’s account, yet alone they explain very little. One requires a clear articulation of what “aesthetic emotions” are, and what it is to have them stirred. Also it seems crucial to note that for Bell we have no other means of recognising a work of art than our feeling for it. The subjectivity of such a claim is, for Bell, to be maintained in any system of aesthetics. Furthermore it is the exercise of bringing the viewer to feel the aesthetic emotion (combined with an attempt to account for the degree of aesthetic emotion experienced) that constitutes the function of criticism. “…[I]t is useless for a critic to tell me that something is a work of art; he must make me feel it for myself. This he can do only by making me see; he must get at my emotions through my eyes.” Without such an emotional attachment the subject will be in no position to legitimately attribute to the object the status of artwork.

Unlike the proponents of the previous century Bell is not so much claiming an ought (initially) but an is. Significant form must be the measure of artistic value as it is the only thing that all those works we have valued through the ages have in common. For Bell we have no other means of recognising a work of art than our feeling for it. If a work is unable to engage our feelings it fails, it is not art. If it engages our feelings, but feelings that are sociologically contingent (for example, certain moral sensibilities that might be diminished or lost over time), it is not engaging aesthetic sensibilities and, inasmuch, is not art. Thus if a work is unable to stir the viewer in this precise and uncontaminated way (in virtue of its formal qualities alone), it will be impossible to ascribe to the object the status of artwork.

We are, then, to understand that certain forms—lines, colours, in particular combinations—are de facto producers of some kind of aesthetic emotion. They are in this sense “significant” in a manner that other forms are not. Without exciting aesthetic rapture, although certain forms may interest us; amuse us; capture our attention, the object under scrutiny will not be a work of art. Bell tells us that art can transport us

[F]rom the world of man’s activity to a world of aesthetic exaltation. For a moment we are shut off from human interests; our anticipations and memories are arrested; we are lifted above the stream of life. The pure mathematician rapt in his studies knows a state of mind which I take to be similar if not identical.

Thus the significance in question is a significance unrelated to the significance of life. “In this [the aesthetic] world the emotions of life find no place. It is a world with emotions of its own.” Bell writes that before feeling an aesthetic emotion one perceives the rightness and necessity of the combination of form at issue, he even considers whether it is this, rather than the form itself, that provokes the emotion in question. Bell’s position appears to echo G. E. Moore’s intuitionism in the sense that one merely contemplates the object and recognises the significant form that constitutes its goodness.

But the spectator is not required to know anything more than that significant form is exhibited. Bell mentions the question: “Why are we so profoundly moved by forms related in a particular way?” yet dismisses the matter as extremely interesting but irrelevant to aesthetics. Bell’s view is that for “pure aesthetics” we need only consider our emotion and its object—we do not need to “pry behind the object into the state of mind of him who made it.” For pure aesthetics, then, it need only be agreed that certain forms do move us in certain ways, it being the business of an artist to arrange forms such that they so move us.

b. The Pursuit of Lasting Values

Central to Bell’s account was a contention that the response elicited in the apprehension of significant form is one incomparable with the emotional responses of the rest of experience. The world of human interests and emotions do, of course, temper a great deal of our interactions with valuable objects, these can be enjoyable and beneficial, but constitute impure appreciation. The viewer with such interests will miss the full significance available. He or she will not get the best that art can give. Bell is scathing of the mistaken significance that can be attributed to representational content, this too signifies impure appreciation. He suggests that those artists “too feeble to create forms that provoke more than a little aesthetic emotion will try to eke that little out by suggesting the emotions of life”. Such interests betray a propensity in artists and viewers to merely bring to art and take away nothing more than the ideas and associations of their own age or experience. Such prima facie significance is the significance of a defective sensibility. As it depends only on what one can bring to the object, nothing new is added to one’s life in its apprehension. For Bell, then, significant form is able to carry the viewer out of life and into ecstasy. The true artist is capable of feeling such emotion, which can be expressed only in form; it is this that the subject apprehends in the true artwork.

Much visual art is concerned with the physical world—whatever the emotion the artists express may be, it seemingly comes through the contemplation of the familiar. Bell is careful to state, therefore, that this concern for the physical world can be (or should be) nothing over and above a concern for the means to the inspired emotional state. Any other concerns, such as practical utility, are to be ignored by art. With this claim Bell meant to differentiate the use of artworks for documentary, educational, or historical purposes. Such attentions lead to a loss of the feeling of emotions that allow one to get to the thing in itself. These are interests that come between things and our emotional reaction to them. In this area Bell is dismissive of the practice of intellectually carving up our environment into practically identified individuations. Such a practice is superficial in requiring our contemplation only to the extent to which an object is to be utilised. It marks a habit of recognising the label and overlooking the thing, and is indicative of a visual shallowness that prohibits the majority of us from seeing “emotionally” and from grasping the significance of form.

Bell holds that the discerning viewer is concerned only with line and colour, their relations and qualities, the apprehension of which (in significant form) can allow the viewer an emotion more powerful, profound, and genuinely significant than can be afforded by any description of facts or ideas. Thus, for Bell:

Great art remains stable and unobscure because the feelings that it awakens are independent of time and place, because its kingdom is not of this world. To those who have and hold a sense of the significance of form what does it matter whether the forms that move them were created in Paris the day before yesterday or in Babylon fifty centuries ago. The forms of art are inexhaustible; but all lead by the same road of aesthetic emotion to the same world of aesthetic ecstasy. (1913, p.16)

What Bell seems to be pushing for is a significance that will not be contingent on peculiarities of one age or inclination, and it is certainly interesting to see what a pursuit of this characteristic can yield. However, it is unclear why one may only reach this kind of significance by looking to emotions that are (in some sense) out of this world. Some have criticised Bell on his insistence that aesthetic emotion could be a response wholly separate from the rest of a person’s emotional character. Thomas McLaughlin (1977) claims that there could not be a pure aesthetic emotion in Bell’s sense, arguing that the aesthetic responses of a spectator are influenced by her normal emotional patterns. On this view the spectator’s emotions, including moral reactions, are brought directly into play under the control of the artist’s technique. It is difficult to deny that the significance, provocativeness and interest in many works of art do indeed require the spectator to bring with them their worldly experiences and sensibilities. John Carey (2005) is equally condemning of Bell’s appeal to the peculiar emotion provided by works of art. He is particularly critical of Bell’s contention that the same emotion could be transmitted between discreet historical periods (or between artist and latter-day spectator). On the one hand, Bell could not possibly know he is experiencing the same emotion as the Chaldean four thousand years earlier, but more importantly to experience the same emotion one would have to share the same unconscious, to have undergone the same education, to have been shaped by the same emotional experiences.

It is important to note that such objections are not entirely decisive. Provocativeness in general and indeed any interests of this kind are presumably ephemeral qualities of a work. These are exactly the kinds of transitory evaluations that Bell was keen to sidestep in characterising true works and the properties of lasting value. The same can be said for all those qualities that are only found in a work in virtue of the spectator’s peculiar education and emotional experience. Bell does acknowledge such significances but doesn’t give to them the importance that he gives to formal significance. It is when we strip away the interests, educations, and the provocations of a particular age that we get to those works that exhibit lasting worth. Having said that, there is no discernible argument in support of the claim that the lasting worth Bell attempts to isolate should be taken to be more valuable, more (or genuinely) significant than the kinds of ephemeral values he dismisses. Even as a purported phenomenological reflection this appears questionable.

In discussion of much of the criticism Bell’s account has received it is important not to run together two distinct questions. On the one hand there is the question of whether or not there exists some emotion that is peculiar to the aesthetic; that is “otherworldly” in the sense that it is not to be confused with those responses that temper the rest of our lives. The affirmation of this is certainly implicated in Bell’s account and is rightly met with some consternation. But what is liable to become obscured is that the suggestion of such an inert aesthetic emotion was part of Bell’s solution to the more interesting question with which his earlier writing was concerned. This question concerns whether or not one might isolate a particular reaction to certain (aesthetic) objects that is sufficiently independent of time, place and enculturation that one might expect it to be exhibited in subjects irrespective of their historical and social circumstance.

One response to this question is indeed to posit an emotional response that is unlike all those responses that are taken to be changeable and contingent on time, culture and so forth. Looking at the changeable interests of the art-world over time, one might well see that an interest in representation or subject matter betrays the spectator’s allegiance to “the gross herd” (as Bell puts it) of some era. But it seems this response is unsatisfactory. As we have seen, McLaughlin and Carey are sceptical of the kind of inert emotion Bell stipulates. Bell’s response to such criticisms is to claim that those unable to accept the postulation are simply ignorant of the emotion he describes. While this is philosophically unsatisfactory the issue is potentially moot. Still, it might be thought that there are other ways in which one might characterise lasting value such as to capture the kind of quality Bell pursued whilst dismissing the more ephemeral significances that affect a particular time.

Regarding the second question, it is tempting to see something more worthwhile in Bell’s enterprise. There is at least some prima facie attraction to Bell’s response, for, assuming that one is trying to distinguish art from non-art, if one hopes to capture something stable and unobscure in drawing together all those things taken to be art, one might indeed look to formal properties of works and one will (presumably) only include those works from any time that do move us in the relevant respect. What is lacking in Bell’s account is some defense of the claim, firstly that those things that move Bell are the domain of true value, and secondly that we should be identifying something stable and unobscure. Why should we expect to identify objects of antiquity as valuable artworks on the basis of their stirring our modern dispositions (excepting the claim—Bell’s claim—that such dispositions are not modern at all but timeless)? Granted, there are some grounds for pursuing the kind of account Bell offers, particularly if one is interested in capturing those values that stand the test of time. However, Bell appears to motivate such a pursuit by making a qualitative claim that such values are in some way more significant, more valuable than those he rejects. And it is difficult to isolate any argument for such a claim.

c. Aesthetic versus Non-Aesthetic Appreciation

The central line of Bell’s account that appears difficult to accept is that while one might be able to isolate a specifically perceptual response to artworks, it seems that one could only equate this response with all that is valuable in art if one were able to qualify the centrality of this response to the exclusion of others. This presentation will not address (as some critics do) the question of whether such a purely aesthetic response can be identified; this must be addressed if anything close to Bell’s account is to be pursued. But for the time being all one need acknowledge is that the mere existence of this response is not enough to legitimise the work Bell expected it to do. A further argument is required to justify a thesis that puts formal features (or our responses to these) at centre stage.

Yet aside from this aim there are some valuable mechanisms at work in Bell’s theory. As a corollary of his general stance, Bell mentions that to understand art we do not need to know anything about art-history. It may be that from works of art we can draw inferences as to the sort of people who made them; but an intimate understanding of an artist will not tell us whether his pictures are any good. This point again relates to Bell’s contention that pure aesthetics is concerned only with the question of whether or not objects have a specific emotional significance to us. Other questions, he believes, are not questions for aesthetics:

To appreciate a man’s art I need know nothing whatever about the artist; I can say whether this picture is better than that without the help of history, but if I am trying to account for the deterioration of his art, I shall be helped by knowing that he has been seriously ill… To mark the deterioration was to make a pure, aesthetic judgement: to account for it was to become an historian. (1913, pp.44-5, emphasis added)

The above passage illustrates an element of Bell’s account some subsequent thinkers have been keen to preserve. Bell holds that attributing value to a work purely on the basis of the position it holds within an art-historical tradition, (because it is by Picasso, or marks the advent of cubism) is not a pursuit of aesthetics. Although certain features and relations may be interesting historically, aesthetically these can be of no consequence. Indeed valuing an object because it is old, interesting, rare, or precious can over-cloud one’s aesthetic sensibility and puts one at a disadvantage compared to the viewer who knows and cares nothing of the object under consideration. Representation is, also, nothing to do with art’s value according to Bell. Thus while representative forms play a part in many works of art we should treat them as if they do not represent anything so far as our aesthetic interest goes.

It is fairly well acknowledged that Bell had a non-philosophical agenda for these kinds of claims. It is easy to see in Bell a defense of the value of abstract art over other art forms and this was indeed his intention. The extent to which Renaissance art can be considered great, for example, has nothing to do with representational accuracy but must be considered only in light of the formal qualities exhibited. In this manner many of the values formerly identified in artworks, and indeed movements, would have to be dismissed as deviations from the sole interest of the aesthetic: the pursuit of significant form.

There is a sense in which we should not underplay the role of the critic or philosopher who should be capable of challenging our accepted practices; capable of refining or cultivating our tastes. To this end Bell’s claims are not out of place. However, while there is some tendency to reflect upon purely formal qualities of a work of art rather than artistic technique or various associations; while there is a sense in which many artists attempt to depict something beyond the evident (utility driven) perceptual shallowness that can dictate our perceptual dealings, it remains obscure why this should be our only interest. Unfortunately, the exclusionary nature of Bell’s account seems only to be concerned with the aesthetic narrowly conceived, excluding any possibility of the development of, or importance of, other values and interests, both as things stand and in future artistic development. Given the qualitative claim Bell demands concerning the superior value of significant form this appears more and more troubling with the increasing volume of works (and indeed values) that would have to be ignored under Bell’s formulation.

As a case in point (perhaps a contentious one but there are any number of related examples), consider Duchamp’s Fountain (1917). In line with much of the criticism referred to in Part 1, the problem is that because Bell identifies aesthetic value (as he construes it) with “art-hood” itself, Artistic Formalism has nothing to say about a urinal that purports to be anti-aesthetic and yet art. Increasingly, artworks are recognised as such and valued for reasons other than the presence (or precisely because of their lack) of aesthetic properties, or exhibited beauty. The practice continues, the works are criticised and valued, and formalists of this kind can do very little but stamp their feet. The death of Artistic Formalism is apparently heralded by the departure of practice from theory.

d. Conclusions: From Artistic to (Moderate) Aesthetic Formalism

So what are we to take from Bell’s account? His claims that our interactions with certain artworks yield an emotion peculiar to the aesthetic, and not experienced in our everyday emotional lives, is rightly met with consternation. It is unclear why we should recognise such a reaction to be of a different kind (let alone a more valuable kind) to those experienced in other contexts such as to discount many of our reactions to ostensible aesthetic objects as genuine aesthetic responses. Few are prompted by Bell’s account to accept this determination of the aesthetic nor does it seem to satisfactorily capture all that we should want to in this area. However, Bell’s aim in producing this theory was (ostensibly) to capture something common to aesthetic objects. In appealing to a timeless emotion that will not be subject to the contingencies of any specific era, Bell seemingly hoped to account for the enduring values of works throughout time. It is easy enough to recognise this need and the place Bell’s theory is supposed to hold in satisfying what does appear to be a sensible requirement. It is less clear that this path, if adequately pursued, should be found to be fruitless.

That we should define the realm of the aesthetic in virtue of those works that stand the test of time has been intuitive to some; how else are we to draw together all those objects worthy of theoretical inclusion whilst characterising and discounting failed works, impostors, and anomalies? Yet there is something disconcerting about this procedure. That we should ascribe the label “art” or even “aesthetic” to a conjunction of objects that have, over time, continued to impress on us some valuable property, seems to invite a potentially worrying commitment to relativity. The preceding discussion has given some voice to a familiar enough contention that by indexing value to our current sensibility we stand to dismiss things that might have been legitimately valued in the past. Bell’s willingness to acknowledge, even rally for, the importance of abstract art leads him to a theory that identifies the value of works throughout history only on the basis of their displaying qualities (significant form) that he took to be important. The cost (although for Bell this is no cost) of such a theory is that things like representational dexterity (a staple of the Renaissance) must be struck from the list of aesthetically valuable properties, just as the pursuit of such a quality by artists must be characterised as misguided.

The concern shared by those who criticise Bell seems to stem from an outlook according to which any proposed theory should be able to capture and accommodate the moving trends, interests and evaluations that constitute art history and drive the very development of artistic creation. This is what one expects an art theory to be able to do. This is where Artistic Formalism fails, as art-practice and art theory diverge. Formalism, as a theory of art, is ill suited to make ontological distinctions between genuine- and non-art. A theory whose currency is perceptually available value will be ill-equipped to officiate over a practice that is governed by, amongst other things, institutional considerations; in fact a practice that is able to develop precisely by identifying recognised values and then subverting them. For these reasons it seems obvious that Formalism is not a bad theory of art but is no theory of art at all.

This understood, one can begin to see those elements of Bell’s Formalism that may be worth salvaging and those that must be rejected. For instance, Bell ascribes a particular domain to aesthetic judgements, reactions, and evaluations such as to distinguish a number of other pronouncements that can also be made in reference to the object in question (some, perhaps, deserve to be labelled “aesthetic” but some—arguably—do not). Bell can say of Picasso’s Guernica (1937) that the way it represents and expresses various things about the Spanish Civil War might well be politically and historically interesting (and valuable)—and might lead to the ascription of various properties to the work (being moving, or harsh). Likewise, the fact that it is by Picasso (or is a genuine Picasso rather than a forgery) will be of interest to some and might also lead to the ascription of certain properties. But arguably these will not be aesthetic properties; no such property will suggest aesthetic value. Conversely, the fact that a particular object is a fake is often thought to devalue the work; for many it may even take away the status of work-hood. But for Bell if the object were genuinely indistinguishable from the original, then it will be capable of displaying the same formal relations and will thus exhibit equal aesthetic value. It is this identification of aesthetic value with formal properties of the work that appears—for some—to continue to hold some plausibility.

However, there have been few (if any) sympathisers towards Bell’s insistence that only if something displayed value in virtue of its formal features would it count as art, or as valuable in an aesthetic. A more moderate position would be to ascribe a particular domain to formal aesthetic judgements, reactions and evaluations, while distinguishing these from both non-formal aesthetic judgements, and non-aesthetic (for example, artistic, political, historical) judgements. On this kind of approach, Bell’s mistake was two-fold: Bell ran into difficulties when he (1) attempted to tie Formalism to the nature of art itself, and (2) restricted the aesthetic exclusively to a formal conception of beauty.

By construing formalism as an aesthetic theory (as an account of what constitutes aesthetic value) or as part of an aesthetic theory (as an account of one kind of aesthetic value), whilst at the same time admitting that there are other values to be had (both aesthetic and non-aesthetic), the Formalist needn’t go so far as to ordain the priority or importance of this specific value in the various practices in which it features. In this way, one can anticipate the stance of the Moderate Formalist who asserts (in terms reminiscent of Kant’s account) there to be two kinds of beauty: formal beauty, and non-formal beauty. Formal beauty is an aesthetic property that is entirely determined by “narrow” non-aesthetic properties (these include sensory and non-relational physical properties such as the lines and colours on the surface of a painting).  Non-formal beauty is determined by “broad” non-aesthetic properties (which covers anything else, including appeals to the content-related aspects that would be required to ascertain the aptness or suitability of certain features for the intended end of the painting, or the accuracy of a representational portrait, or the category to which an artwork belongs).

While these notions require much clarification (see Part 3), a useful way to express the aspirations of this account would be to note that the Moderate Formalist claims that their metaphysical stance generates the only theory capable of accommodating the aesthetic properties of all works of art. Unlike Bell’s “extreme Formalism”, maintaining all aesthetic properties to be narrowly determined by sensory and intrinsic physical properties; and unlike “anti-Formalism”, according to which all aesthetic properties are at least partly determined by broad non-aesthetic properties such as the artist’s intentions, or the artwork’s history of production; the Moderate Formalist insists that, in the context of the philosophy of art, many artworks have a mix of formal and non-formal aesthetic properties; that others have only non-formal aesthetic properties; and that at least some artworks have only formal aesthetic properties.

3. Nick Zangwill’s Moderate Aesthetic Formalism

The issue of formalism is introduced on the assumption that aesthetic properties are determined by certain non-aesthetic properties; versions of formalism differ primarily in their answers to the question of which non-aesthetic properties are of interest. This part of the presentation briefly outlines the central characterisations of “form” (and their differences) that will be pertinent to an understanding of twenty-first century discussions of Formalism. For present purposes, and in light of the previous discussion, it will be satisfactory to focus on formal characterisations of artworks and, more specifically visual art.

a. Extreme Formalism, Moderate Formalism, Anti-Formalism

Nick Zangwill recognises that arrangements of lines, shapes, and colours (he includes “shininess” and “glossiness” as colour properties) are typically taken as formal properties, contrasting these with non-formal properties which are determined, in part, by the history of production or context of creation for the artwork. In capturing this divide, he writes:

The most straightforward account would be to say that formal properties are those aesthetic properties that are determined solely by sensory or physical properties—so long as the physical properties in question are not relations to other things or other times. This would capture the intuitive idea that formal properties are those aesthetic properties that are directly perceivable or that are determined by properties that are directly perceivable. (2001, p.56)

Noting that this will not accommodate the claims of some philosophers that aesthetic properties are “dispositions to provoke responses in human beings”, Zangwill stipulates the word “narrow” to include sensory properties, non-relational physical properties, and dispositions to provoke responses that might be thought part-constitutive of aesthetic properties; the word “broad” covers anything else (such as the extrinsic property of the history of production of a work). We can then appeal to a basic distinction: "Formal properties are entirely determined by narrow nonaesthetic properties, whereas nonformal aesthetic properties are partly determined by broad nonaesthetic properties." (2001, p.56)

On this basis, Zangwill identifies Extreme Formalism as the view that all aesthetic properties of an artwork are formal (and narrowly determined), and Anti-Formalism as the view that no aesthetic properties of an artwork are formal (all are broadly determined by history of production as well as narrow non-aesthetic properties). His own view is a Moderate Formalism, holding that some aesthetic properties of an artwork are formal, others are not. He motivates this view via a number of strategies but in light of earlier parts of this discussion it will be appropriate to focus on Zangwill’s responses to those arguments put forward by the anti-formalist.

b. Responding to Kendall Walton’s Anti-Formalism

Part 1 briefly considersed Kendall Walton’s influential position according to which in order to make any aesthetic judgement regarding a work of art one must see it under an art-historical category. This claim was made in response to various attempts to “purge from criticism of works of art supposedly extraneous excursions into matters not (or not “directly”) available to inspection of the works, and to focus attention on the works themselves” (See, for example, the discussion of Clive Bell in Part 2). In motivating this view Walton offers what he supposes to be various “intuition pumps” that should lead to the acceptance of his proposal.

In defense of a moderate formalist view Nick Zangwill has asserted that Walton’s thesis is at best only partly accurate. For Zangwill, there is a large and significant class of works of art and aesthetic properties of works of art that are purely formal; in Walton’s terms the aesthetic properties of these objects emerge from the “configuration of colours and shapes on a painting” alone. This would suggest a narrower determination of those features of a work “available to inspection” than Walton defends in his claim that the history of production (a non-formal feature) of a work partly determines its aesthetic properties by determining the category to which the work belongs and must be perceived. Zangwill wants to resist Walton’s claim that all or most works and values are category-dependent; aiming to vindicate the disputed negative thesis that “the application of aesthetic concepts to a work of art can leave out of consideration facts about its origin”. Zangwill is keen to point out that a number of the intuition pumps Walton utilises are less decisive than has commonly been accepted.

Regarding representational properties, for example, Walton asks us to consider a marble bust of a Roman emperor which seems to us to resemble a man with, say, an aquiline nose, a wrinkled brow, and an expression of grim determination, and about which we take to represent a man with, or as having, those characteristics. The question is why don’t we say that it resembles or represents a motionless man, of uniform (marble) colour, who is severed at the chest? We are interested in representation and it seems the object is in more respects similar to the latter description than the former. Walton is able to account for the fact that we are not struck by the similarity in the latter sense as we are by the former by appeal to his distinction between standard, contra-standard and variable properties:

The bust’s uniform color, motionlessness, and abrupt ending at the chest are standard properties relative to the category of busts, and since we see it as a bust they are standard for us. […] A cubist work might look like a person with a cubical head to someone not familiar with the cubist style. But the standardness of such cubical shapes for people who see it as a cubist work prevents them from making that comparison. (1970, p.345)

His central claim is that what we take a work to represent (or even resemble) depends only on the variable properties, and not those that are standard, for the category under which we perceive it. It seems fairly obvious that this account must be right. Zangwill agrees and is hence led to accept that in the case of representational qualities there is nothing in the objects themselves that could tell the viewer which of the opposing descriptions is appropriate. For this, one must look elsewhere to such things as the history of production or the conventionally accepted practices according to which the object’s intentional content may be derived.

Zangwill argues that while representational properties might not be aesthetic properties (indeed they are possessed by ostensibly non-aesthetic, non-art items such as maps, blueprints, and road signs) they do appear to be among the base (non-aesthetic) properties that determine aesthetic properties. Given that representational properties of a work are, in part, determined by the history of production, and assuming that some aesthetic properties of representational works are partly determined by what they represent, Zangwill concludes some aesthetic properties to be non-formal. This is no problem for the Moderate Formalist of course; Walton’s intuition pump does not lead to an anti-formalist argument for it seems equally clear that only a subclass of artworks are representational works. Many works have no representational properties at all and are thus unaffected by the insistence that representational properties can only be successfully identified via the presence of art-historical or categorical information. Given that Zangwill accepts Walton’s claim in respect only to a subclass of aesthetic objects, Moderate Formalism remains undisturbed.

However, Walton offers other arguments that might be thought to have a more general application and thus forestall this method of “tactical retreat” on the part of the would-be Moderate Formalist. The claim that Walton seems to hold for all artworks (rather than just a subclass) is that the art-historical category into which an artwork falls is aesthetically relevant because one’s belief that a work falls under a particular category affects one’s perception of it—one experiences the work differently when one experiences it under a category. Crucially, understanding a work’s category is a matter of understanding the degrees to which its features are standard, contra-standard and variable with respect to that category. Here is Walton’s most well-known example:

Imagine a society which does not have an established medium of painting, but does produce a kind of work called guernicas. Guernicas are like versions of Picasso’s “Guernica” done in various bas-relief dimensions. All of them are surfaces with the colours and shapes of Picasso’s “Guernica,” but the surfaces are moulded to protrude from the wall like relief maps of different kinds of terrain. […] Picasso’s “Guernica” would be counted as a guernica in this society - a perfectly flat one - rather than as a painting. Its flatness is variable and the figures on its surface are standard relative to the category of guernicas. […] This would make for a profound difference between our reaction to “Guernica” and theirs. (1970, p.347)

When we consider (as a slight amendment to Walton’s example) a guernica in this society that is physically indistinguishable from Picasso’s painting, we should become aware of the different aesthetic responses experienced by members of their society compared to ours. Walton notes that it seems violent, dynamic, vital, disturbing to us, but imagines it would strike them as cold, stark, lifeless, restful, or perhaps bland, dull, boring—but in any case not violent, dynamic, and vital. His point is that the object is only violent and disturbing as a painting, but dull, stark, and so forth as a guernica, hence the thought experiment is supposed to prompt us to agree that aesthetic properties are dependent on (or relative to) the art-historical categories under which the observer subsumes the object in question. Through this example Walton argues that we do not simply judge that an artwork is dynamic and a painting. The only sense in which it is appropriate to claim that Guernica is dynamic is in claiming that it is dynamic as a painting, or for people who see it as a painting.

This analysis has been variously accepted in the literature; it is particularly interesting, therefore, to recognise Zangwill’s initial suspicion of Walton’s account. He notes that a plausible block to this intuition comes in the observation that it becomes very difficult to make aesthetic judgements about whole categories or comparisons of items across categories. Zangwill stipulates that Walton might respond with the claim that we simply widen the categories utilised in our judgements. For example, when we say that Minoan art is (in general) more dynamic than Mycenean art, what we are saying is that this is how it is when we consider both sorts of works as belonging to the class of “prehistoric Greek art”. He continues:

But why should we believe this story? It does not describe a psychological process that we are aware of when we make cross-category judgements. The insistence that we are subconsciously operating with some more embracing category, even though we are not aware of it, seems to be an artefact of the anti-formalist theory that there is no independent reason to believe. If aesthetic judgements are category-dependent, we would expect speakers and thinkers to be aware of it. But phenomenological reflection does not support the category-dependent view. (2001, pp. 92-3)

In these cases, according to Zangwill, support does not appear to be sourced either from phenomenology or from our inferential behaviour. Instead he argues that we can offer an alternative account of what is going on when we say something is “elegant for a C” or “an elegant C”. This involves the claim that questions of goodness and elegance are matters of degree. We often make ascriptions that refer to a comparison class because this is a quicker and easier way of communicating questions of degree. But the formalist will say that the precise degree of some C-thing’s elegance does not involve the elegance of other existing C-things. And being a matter of degree is quite different from being category-dependent. So Zangwill’s claim is that it is pragmatically convenient, but far from essential, that one make reference to a category-class in offering an aesthetic judgement. We are able to make category-neutral aesthetic judgements, and crucially for Zangwill, such judgements are fundamental: category-dependent judgements are only possible because of category-neutral ones. The formalist will hold that without the ability to make category-neutral judgements we would have no basis for comparisons; Walton has not shown that this is not the case.

In this way Zangwill asserts that we can understand that it is appropriate to say that the flat guernica is “lifeless” because it is less lively than most guernicas— but this selection of objects is a particularly lively one. Picasso’s Guernica is appropriately thought of as “vital” because it is more so than most paintings; considered as a class these are not particularly lively. But in fact the painting and the guernica might be equally lively, indeed equivalent in respect of their other aesthetic properties—they only appear to differ in respect of the comparative judgements in which they have been embedded. It is for this reason that Zangwill concludes that we can refuse to have our intuitions “pumped” in the direction Walton intends. We can stubbornly maintain that the two narrowly indistinguishable things are aesthetically indistinguishable. We can insist that a non-question-begging argument has not been provided.

On this view, one can allow that reference to art-historical categories is a convenient way of classifying art, artists, and art movements, but the fact that this convenience has been widely utilised need not be telling against alternative accounts of aesthetic value.

c. Kant’s Formalism

Zangwill’s own distinction between formal and non-formal properties is derived (broadly) from Immanuel Kant’s distinction between free and dependent beauty. Indeed, Zangwill has asserted that “Kant was also a moderate formalist, who opposed extreme formalism when he distinguished free and dependent beauty in §16 of the Critique of Judgement” (2005, p.186). In the section in question Kant writes:

There are two kinds of beauty; free beauty (pulchritudo vaga), or beauty which is merely dependent (pulchritudo adhaerens). The first presupposes no concept of what the object should be; the second does presuppose such a concept and, with it, an answering perfection of the object.

On the side of free beauty Kant lists primarily natural objects such as flowers, some birds, and crustacea, but adds wallpaper patterns and musical fantasias; examples of dependent beauties include the beauty of a building such as a church, palace, or summer-house. Zangwill maintains that dependent beauty holds the key to understanding the non-formal aesthetic properties of art—without this notion it will be impossible to understand the aesthetic importance of pictorial representation, or indeed any of the art-forms he analyses. A work that is intended to be a representation of a certain sort—if that intention is successfully realised—will fulfil the representational function the artist intended, and may (it is claimed) do so beautifully. In other words, some works have non-formal aesthetic properties because of (or in virtue of) the way they embody some historically given non-aesthetic function.

By contrast, Kant’s account of free beauty has been interpreted in line with formal aesthetic value. At §16 and §17, Kant appears to place constraints on the kinds of objects that can exemplify pure (that is, formal) beauty, suggesting that nature, rather than art, provides the proper objects of (pure) aesthetic judgement and that to the extent that artworks can be (pure) objects of tastes they must be abstract, non-representational, works. If this is a consequence of Kant’s account, the strong Formalist position derived from judgements of pure beauty would presumably have to be restricted in application to judgements of abstract art and, perhaps in quotidian cases, the objects of nature. However, several commentators (for example, Crawford (1974) and Guyer (1997)) have maintained that Kant’s distinction between free and dependent beauty does not entail the classification of art (even representational art) as merely dependently beautiful. Crawford, for example, takes the distinction between free and dependent beauty to turn on the power of the judger to abstract towards a disinterested position; this is because he takes Kant’s distinction to be between kinds of judgement and not between kinds of object.

This is not the place for a detailed exegesis of Kant’s aesthetics, but it is pertinent to at least note the suggestion that it is nature (rather than art) that provides the paradigm objects of formal aesthetic judgement. In the next part of this presentation we will explore this possibility, further considering Zangwill’s moderate, and more extreme Formalist conclusions in the domain of nature appreciation.

4. From Art to the Aesthetic Appreciation of Nature

Allen Carlson is well known for his contribution to the area broadly known as “environmental aesthetics”, perhaps most notably for his discussion of the aesthetic appreciation of nature (2000). Where discussing the value of art Carlson seems to adopt a recognisably moderate formalist position, acknowledging both that where formalists like Bell went wrong was in presupposing formalism to be the only valid way to appreciate visual artworks (pace Part 2), but also suggesting that a “proper perspective” on the application of formalism should have revealed it to be one among many “orientations” deserving recognition in art appreciation (pace Part 3). However, when turning to the appreciation of the natural environment Carlson adopts and defends a strongly anti-formalist position, occupying a stance that has been referred to as “cognitive naturalism”. This part of the presentation briefly discusses Carlson’s rejection of formalism before presenting some moderate, and stronger formalist replies in this domain.

a. Anti-Formalism and Nature

Carlson has characterised contemporary debates in the aesthetics of nature as attempting to distance nature appreciation from theories of the appreciation of art. Contemporary discussion introduces different models for the appreciation of nature in place of the inadequate attempts to apply artistic norms to an environmental domain. For example, in his influential “Appreciation and the Natural Environment” (1979) he had disputed both “object” and “landscape” models of nature appreciation (which might be thought attractive to the Moderate Formalist), favouring the “natural environmental” model (which stands in opposition to the other two). Carlson acknowledged that the “object” model has some utility in the art-world regarding the appreciation of non-representational sculpture (he takes Brancusi’s Bird in Space (1919) as an example). Such sculpture can have significant (formal) aesthetic properties yet no representational connections to the rest of reality or relational connections with its immediate surroundings. Indeed, he acknowledges that the formalist intuitions discussed earlier have remained prevalent in the domain of nature appreciation, meeting significant and sustained opposition only in the domain of art criticism.

When it comes to nature-appreciation, formalism has remained relatively uncontested and popular, emerging as an assumption in many theoretical discussions. However, Carlson’s conclusion on the “object” and “landscape” models is that the former rips natural objects from their larger environments while the latter frames and flattens them into scenery. In focussing mainly on formal properties, both models neglect much of our normal experience and understanding of nature.  The “object” model is inappropriate as it cannot recognise the organic unity between natural objects and their environment of creation or display, such environments are—Carlson believes—aesthetically relevant. This model thus imposes limitations on our appreciation of natural objects as a result of the removal of the object from its surroundings (which this model requires in order to address the questions of what and how to appreciate). For Carlson, the natural environment cannot be broken down into discrete parts, divorced from their former environmental relations any more than it can be reduced to a static, two-dimensional scene (as in the “landscape” model). Instead he holds that the natural environment must be appreciated for what it is, both nature and an environment. On this view natural objects possess an organic unity with their environment of creation: they are a part of and have developed out of the elements of their environments by means of the forces at work within those environments. Thus some understanding of the environments of creation is relevant to the aesthetic appreciation of natural objects.

The assumption implicit in the above rejection of Formalism is familiar from the objections (specifically regarding Walton) from Part 3. It is the suggestion that the appropriate way to appreciate some target object is via recourse to the kind of thing it is; taking the target for something it is not does not constitute appropriate aesthetic appreciation of that thing. Nature is natural so cannot be treated as “readymade” art. Carlson holds that the target for the appreciation of nature is also an environment, entailing that the appropriate mode of appreciation is active, involved appreciation. It is the appreciation of a judge who is in the environment, being part of and reacting to it, rather than merely being an external onlooker upon a two-dimensional scene. It is this view that leads to his strong anti-formalist suggestion that the natural environment as such does not possess formal qualities. For example, responding to the “landscape” model Carlson suggests that the natural environment itself only appears to have formal qualities when a person somehow imposes a frame upon it and thus formally composes the resultant view. In such a case it is the framed view that has the qualities, but these will vary depending upon the frame and the viewer’s position. As a consequence Carlson takes the formal features of nature, such as they are, to be (nearly) infinitely realisable; insofar as the natural environment has formal qualities, they have an indeterminateness, making them both difficult to appreciate, and of little significance in the appreciation of nature.

Put simply, the natural environment is not an object, nor is it a static two-dimensional “picture”, thus it cannot be appreciated in ways satisfactory for objects or pictures; furthermore, the rival models discussed do not reveal significant or sufficiently determinate appreciative features. In rejecting these views Carlson has been concerned with the questions of what and how we should appreciate; his answer involves the necessary acknowledgement that we are appreciating x qua x, where some further conditions will be specifiable in relation to the nature of the x in question. It is in relation to this point that Carlson’s anti-formalist “cognitive naturalism” presents itself.

In this respect his stance on nature appreciation differs from Walton’s, who did not extend his philosophical claims to aesthetic judgements about nature (Walton lists clouds, mountains, sunsets), believing that these judgements, unlike judgements of art, are best understood in terms of a category-relative interpretation. By contrast, Carlson can be understood as attempting to extend Walton’s category dependent account of art-appreciation to the appreciation of nature. On this view we do not need to treat nature as we treat those artworks about whose origins we know nothing because it is not the case that we know nothing of nature:

In general we do not produce, but rather discover, natural objects and aspects of nature. Why should we therefore not discover the correct categories for their perception? We discover whales and later discover that, in spite of somewhat misleading perceptual properties, they are in fact mammals and not fish. (Carlson, 2000, p.64)

By discovering the correct categories to which objects or environments belong, we can know which is the correct judgement to make (the whale is not a lumbering and inelegant fish). It is in virtue of this that Carlson claims our judgements of the aesthetic appreciation of nature sustain responsible criticism in the way Walton characterises the appreciation of art. It is for this reason that Carlson concludes that for the aesthetic appreciation of nature, something like the knowledge and experience of the naturalist or ecologist is essential. This knowledge gives us the appropriate foci of aesthetic significance and the appropriate boundaries of the setting so that our experience becomes one of aesthetic appreciation. He concludes that the absence of such knowledge, or any failure to perceive nature under the correct categories, leads to aesthetic omission and, indeed, deception.

b. Formalism and Nature.

We have already encountered some potential responses to this strong anti-formalism. The moderate formalist may attempt to deploy a version of the aesthetic/non-aesthetic distinction such as to deny that the naturalist and ecologist are any better equipped than the rest of us to aesthetically appreciate nature. They are, of course, better equipped to understand nature, and to evaluate (in what we might call a “non-aesthetic” sense) the objects and environments therein. This type of response claims that the ecologist can judge (say) the perfectly self-contained and undisturbed ecosystem, can indeed respond favourably to her knowledge of the rarity of such a find. Such things are valuable in that they are of natural-historical interest. Such things are of interest and significance to natural-historians, no doubt. The naturalist will know that the whale is not “lumbering” compared to most fish (and will not draw this comparison), and will see it as “whale-like”, “graceful”, perhaps particularly “sprightly” compared to most whales. One need not deny that such comparative, cognitive judgements can feel a particular way, or that such judgements are a significant part of the appreciation of nature; but it may be possible to deny that these (or only these) judgements deserve to be called aesthetic.

However, Carlson’s objection is not to the existence of formal value, but to the appropriateness of consideration of such value. Our knowledge of an environment is supposed to allow us to select certain foci of aesthetic significance and abstract from, or exclude, others such as to characterise different kinds of appropriate experience:

…we must survey a prairie environment, looking at the subtle contours of the land, feeling the wind blowing across the open space, and smelling the mix of prairie grasses and flowers. But such an act of aspection has little place in a dense forest environment. Here we must examine and scrutinise, inspecting the detail of the forest floor, listening carefully for the sounds of birds and smelling carefully for the scent of spruce and pine. (Carlson, 2000, p.64)

Clearly knowledge of the terrain and environment that is targeted in each of these cases might lead the subject to be particularly attentive to signs of certain expected elements; however, there are two concerns that are worth highlighting in closing.

Firstly, it is unclear why one should, for all one’s knowledge of the expected richness or desolation of some particular landscape, be in a position to assume of (say) the prairie environment that no detailed local scrutiny should yield the kind of interest or appreciation (both formal and non-formal) that might be found in other environments. It is unclear whether Carlson could allow that such acts might yield appreciation but must maintain that they would not yield instances of aesthetic appreciation of that environment, or whether he is denying the availability of such unpredicted values—in either case the point seems questionable. Perhaps the suspicion is one that comes from proportioning one’s expectation to one’s analysis of the proposed target. The first concern is thus that knowledge (even accurate knowledge) can be as potentially blinding as it is potentially enlightening.

The second concern is related to the first, but poses more of a direct problem for Carlson. His objection to the “object” and “landscape” models regards their propensity to limit the potentiality for aesthetic judgement by taking the target to be something other than it truly is. Part of the problem described above relates to worries regarding the reduction of environments to general categories like prairie landscape, dense forest, pastoral environment such that one enlists expectations of those attentions that will and will not be rewarded, and limits one’s interaction accordingly. While it might be true that some understanding of the kind of environment we are approaching will suggest certain values to expect as well as indicating the act of aspection appropriate for delivering just these, the worry is that this account may be unduly limiting because levels of appreciation are unlikely to exceed the estimations of the theory and the acts of engagement and interaction these provoke. In nature more than anywhere else this seems to fail to do justice to those intuitions that the target really is (amongst other things) a rich, unconstrained sensory manifold. To briefly illustrate the point with a final example, Zangwill (2001, pp.116-8) considers such cases (which he doesn’t think Carlson can account for) as the unexpected or incongruous beauty of the polar bear swimming underwater. Not only is this “the last thing we expected”, but our surprise shows that

…it is not a beauty that we took to be dependent in some way upon our grasp of its polar-bearness. We didn’t find it elegant as a polar bear. It is a category-free beauty. The underwater polar bear is a beautiful thing in beautiful motion…

The suggestion here is that to “do justice to” and thus fully appreciate the target one must be receptive not simply to the fact that it is nature, or that it is an environment, but that it is, first and foremost, the individual environment that it (and not our understanding of it) reveals itself to be. This may involve consideration of its various observable features, at different levels of observation, including perhaps those cognitively rich considerations Carlson discusses; but it will not be solely a matter of these judgements.  According to the (Moderate) Formalist, the “true reality” of things is more than Carlson’s account seems capable of capturing, for while a natural environment is not in fact a static two-dimensional scene, it may well in fact possess (amongst other things) a particular appearance for us, and that appearance may be aesthetically valuable. The Moderate Formalist can accommodate that value without thereby omitting acknowledgement of other kinds of values, including those Carlson defends.

Finally, it should be noted that when it comes to inorganic nature, Zangwill has argued for a stronger formalist position (much closer to Bell’s view about visual art). The basic argument for this conclusion is that even if a case can be made for claiming that much of organic nature should be understood and appreciated via reference to some kind of “history of production” (typically in terms of biological functions, usually thought to depend on evolutionary history), inorganic or non-biological nature (rivers, rocks, sunsets, the rings of Saturn) does not have functions and therefore cannot have aesthetic properties that depend on functions. Nor should we aesthetically appreciate inorganic things in the light of functions they do not have.

5. Conclusions

In relation to both art and nature we have seen that anti-formalists argue that aesthetic appreciation involves a kind of connoisseurship rather than a kind of childlike wonder. Bell’s extreme (artistic) formalism appeared to recommend a rather restricted conception of the art-connoisseur. Walton’s and Carlson’s anti-formalism (in relation to art and nature respectively) both called for the expertise and knowledge base required to identify and apply the “correct” category under which an item of appreciation must be subsumed. Yet the plausibility of challenges to these stances (both the strong formalism of Bell and the strong anti-formalism of Walton and Carlson) appears to be grounded in more moderate, tolerant proposals. Zangwill, for example, defends his moderate formalism as “a plea for open-mindedness” under the auspices of attempts to recover some of our aesthetic innocence.

This presentation began with an historical overview intended to help situate (though not necessarily motivate or defend) the intuition that there is some important sense in which aesthetic qualities pertain to the appearance of things. Anti-formalists point out that beauty, ugliness, and other aesthetic qualities often (or always) pertain to appearances as informed by our beliefs and understanding about the reality of things. Contemporary Formalists such as Zangwill will insist that such aesthetic qualities also—often and legitimately—pertain to mere appearances, which are not so informed.

On this more moderate approach, the aesthetic responses of the connoisseur, the art-historian, the ecologist can be acknowledged while nonetheless insisting that the sophisticated aesthetic sensibility has humble roots and we should not forget them. Formal aesthetic appreciation may be more “raw, naïve, and uncultivated” (Zangwill, 2005, p.186), but arguably it has its place.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Bell, Clive (1913) Art Boston, Massachusetts.
    • An important presentation and defense of Artistic Formalism in the Philosophy of Art.
  • Budd, Malcolm (1996) ‘The Aesthetic Appreciation of Nature’ British Journal of Aesthetics 36, pp.207-222
    • For some important challenges to the anti-formalist views put forward by Carlson (2000); in particular, Budd supports the intuition that part of the value of nature relates to its boundless, unconstrained, and variable potential for appreciation.
  • Carey, John (2005) What Good are the Arts? London: Faber and Faber
    • While pertinent, Carey’s discussion should be treated with some caution as, unlike McLaughlin (1977), he writes with a tone that seeks to trivialise Bell’s position and, at times, apparently misses the acuity with which Bell presented his formulation.
  • Carlson, Allen, (1979) ‘Appreciation and the Natural Environment’ The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 37, pp. 267-275
    • An early indication and defense of Carlson’s “Natural environmental” model of appreciation (compare Carlson (2000)).
  • Carlson, Allen (2000) Aesthetics and the Environment, Art and Architecture London and New York: Routledge
    • An influential book in which Carlson draws together much of his work over the previous two decades.
  • Crawford, Donald (1974) Kant’s Aesthetic Theory Madison: Wisconsin University Press
    • A scholarly and influential engagement with Kant’s Critique of Judgement (see also Guyer (1997)).
  • Currie, Gregory (1989) An Ontology of Art Basingstoke: Macmillan
    • See Chapter 3 especially for a discussion of “Aesthetic Empiricism” in connection with the anti-formalist arguments discussed in Part 1.
  • Danto, Arthur (1981) The Transfiguration of the Commonplace Cambridge, MA.: Harvard University Press
    • For Danto, Warhol’s Brillo Box exhibition (1964) marked a watershed in the history of aesthetics, rendering almost worthless everything written by philosophers on art. Warhol’s sculptures were indistinguishable from ordinary Brillo boxes, putatively showing that an artwork needn’t posses some special perceptually discernible quality in order to afford art-status.
  • Davies, David (2004) Art as Performance Oxford: Blackwell
    • For a discussion of “Aesthetic Empiricism” and some development/departure from Currie’s ontology of art (1989).
  • Dowling, Christopher (2010) 'Zangwill, Moderate Formalism, and another look at Kant’s Aesthetic', Kantian Review 15, pp.90-117
    • Explores the formalist interpretation of Kant’s aesthetics in connection with Zangwill’s moderate formalism.
  • Dutton, Dennis (1983) [ed.] The Forger’s Art Berkeley and Los Angeles, CA.: University of California Press
    • An important collection of articles, including Leonard Meyer’s ‘Forgery and The Anthropology of Art’ (discussed in Part 1); See also, articles in this collection by Alfred Lessing and Jack Meiland.
  • Fry, Roger ([1920] 1956) Vision and Design Cleveland and New York: World Publishing
    • Fry’s collection of essays gives some insight into the changing ideas on European Post Impressionism around the turn of the century. The development of Fry’s aesthetic theory (in relation to significant form) is also discussed by Bell (1913).
  • Guyer, Paul (1997) Kant and the Claims of Taste [2nd Edition] Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
    • A clear and comprehensive critical exploration of Kant’s Critique of Judgement.
  • Hanslick, Eduard (1957) The Beautiful in Music [trans. Gustav Cohen] Indianapolis and New York: Bobbs-Merrill Co
    • In this influential text by “the father of modern musical criticism”, Hanslick arguably lays out much of the groundwork for musical formalism.
  • Kant, Immanuel (1952) Critique of Judgement, [trans. Meredith] Oxford: Clarendon Press
  • McLaughlin, Thomas (1977) ‘Clive Bell’s Aesthetic: Tradition and Significant Form’, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 35, pp435-7
    • A critical discussion of Bell’s Formalism.
  • Parsons, Glenn (2004) 'Natural Functions and the Aesthetic Appreciation of Inorganic Nature', British Journal of Aesthetics 44, pp.44-56
    • Parsons presents some challenges to Zangwill's extreme formalism about inorganic nature (for a reply to Parsons see Zangwill, 2005).
  • Walton, Kendall (1970) ‘Categories of Art’, The Philosophical Review 79, pp.334-367
    • A very influential contribution to analytic aesthetics in support of the anti-formalist stance regarding the appreciation of an artwork’s aesthetic properties.
  • Wilcox, John (1953) ‘The Beginnings of L’art pour L’art’, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 11, pp.360-377
    • An instructive article that has informed much of Part 1 of this presentation, and in which you will find references to many of the nineteenth century texts cited here.
  • Wimsatt, W. and Beardsley, M. (1946) ‘The Intentional Fallacy’, Sewanee Review 54, pp.468-88
    • The authors argue against the view that an artwork’s meaning is determined by reference to the artist’s intentions.
  • Zangwill, Nick (2001) The Metaphysics of Beauty, Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press
    • A thorough exploration and defense of formalist intuitions; the book includes re-printed versions of many of Zangwill’s important contributions (for example, his ‘Feasible Aesthetic Formalism’, Noús 33 (1999)) from earlier years.
  • Zangwill, Nick (2005) ‘In Defence of Extreme Formalism about Inorganic Nature: Reply to Parsons’, British Journal of Aesthetics, 45, pp.185-191


Author Information

Christopher Dowling
The Open University
United Kingdom

Art and Emotion

It is widely thought that the capacity of artworks to arouse emotions in audiences is a perfectly natural and unproblemmatic fact. It just seems obvious that we can feel sadness or pity for fictional characters, fear at the view of threatening monsters on the movie screen, and joy upon listening to upbeat, happy songs. This may be why so many of us are consumers of art in the first place. Good art, many of us tend to think, should not leave us cold.

These common thoughts, however natural they are become problematic once we start to make explicit other common ideas about both emotion and our relationship with artworks. If some emotions, such as pity, require that the object of the emotion be believed to exist, even though it actually doesn’t, how would it then be possible to feel pity for a fictional character that we all know does not exist? A task of fundamental importance, therefore, is to explain the possibility of emotion in the context of our dealings with various kinds of artworks.

How are we motivated to pursue, and find value in, an emotional engagement with artworks when much of this includes affective states that we generally count as negative or even painful (fear, sadness, anger, and so on)? If we would rather avoid feeling these emotions in real life, how are we to explain cases where we pursue activities, such as watching films, that we know may arouse similar feelings? Alternatively, why are so many people eager to listen to seemingly deeply distressing musical works when they would not want to feel this way in other contexts? Are most of us guilty of irrational pleasure in liking what makes us feel bad? Answering these and related questions is of prime importance if we wish to vindicate the thought that emotion in response to art is not only a good thing to have, but also valuable in enabling us to appreciate artworks.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Emotion in Response to Representational Artworks: The Paradox of Fiction
    1. Denying the Fictional Emotions Condition
    2. Denying the Belief Condition
    3. Denying the Disbelief Condition: Illusion and Suspension of Disbelief
  3. Emotion in Response to Abstract Artworks: Music
    1. Moods, Idiosyncratic Responses and Surrogate Objects
    2. Emotions as Responses to Musical Expressiveness
      1. Music as Expression of the Composer’s Emotions
      2. Reacting Emotionally to Music’s Persona
      3. Contour Accounts of Expressiveness and Appropriate Emotions
    3. Music as Object
  4. Art and Negative Emotion: The Paradox of Tragedy
    1. Pleasure-Centered Solutions
      1. Negligible Pain
        1. Conversion
        2. Control
        3. No Essential Valence
      2. Compensation
        1. Intellectual Pleasure
        2. Meta-Response
        3. Catharsis
        4. Affective Mixture
    2. Non-Pleasure-Centered Solutions
      1. ‘Relief from Boredom’ and Rich Experience
      2. Pluralism about Reasons for Emotional Engagement
  5. The Rationality of Audience Emotion
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

That emotion is a central part of our dealings with artworks seems undeniable. Yet, natural ideas about emotion, at least taken collectively, make it hard to see why such an assumption should be true. Once we know a bit more about emotion, it isn’t clear how we could feel genuine emotion towards artworks in the first place. Furthermore, if it were possible to find a plausible theory of emotion that would vindicate the claim that we experience genuine emotion towards artworks, questions arise as to why most of us are motivated to engage in artworks, especially when these tend to produce negative emotions. How can the emotion we feel towards artworks be rationally justified? Overall, a proper understanding of our emotional responses to art should shed light on its value.

Although the general question of what an emotion consists in is highly debated, it is nonetheless possible to address a list of fairly uncontroversial general features of emotions that are most relevant to the present discussion.

Cognitive thesis: Emotions are cognitive states in the sense that they purport to be about things in the world. This means they require objects, they have intentionality, and they ascribe certain properties to them. For instance, fear can be thought to be attributed to an object’s dangerous nature or quality. Given that emotions are representational states, they are subject to norms of correctness. A case of fear is inappropriate if the object is not in fact dangerous or threatening. The nature of the relevant state─whether it is a judgment, a perception, or something else─is a matter of debate (see Deonna & Teroni, 2012, for an excellent introduction). Depending on the answer one gives on this issue, one’s views on the nature of our affective states towards artworks may differ.

Belief requirement: Even though emotions are probably not belief-states, they may always depend on beliefs for their existence and justification. One cannot, it seems, grieve over someone’s death if one doesn’t believe that they actually died. Or one cannot hope that it will be sunny tomorrow if one believes that the world is going to end tonight. More relevantly for the rest of the discussion, it may be difficult to make sense of why someone is genuinely afraid of something that does not exist.

Phenomenological thesis: Emotions are typically felt. There is something it is like to be experiencing an emotion; they are ‘qualitative’ states). Moreover, emotions are experienced with various levels of intensity. Sometimes it is possible to be in a situation where a given emotion is experienced at a high/low level of intensity where a higher/lower level is considered appropriate, suggesting that the correctness conditions of emotion should include a condition to the effect that the emotion is appropriately proportionate to its object.

Valence thesis: Emotions have valence or hedonic tone. Their phenomenology is such that some of them are experienced as negative and some as positive. Some emotion types seem to be essentially positive or negative. For example, fear, sadness, and pity are paradigmatic negative emotions, whereas joy and admiration are paradigmatic positive emotions.

All of these features, taken either individually or in combination, raise issues with respect to the alleged emotional relationship we entertain with artworks. Here are a couple of examples. The cognitive thesis and belief requirement make it difficult to see how our affective responses to things we believe to be non-existent, or to strings of meaningless (without representational content) sounds─as in instrumental music─could be genuine emotions. Alternatively, they require us to give a cogent account of the objects of the relevant emotions if these are to count as genuine. The valence thesis, combined with the plausible claim that ‘negative’ emotions are frequently felt in response to artworks, raise the question of how we can be motivated to pursue an engagement with artworks that we know are likely to arouse painful experiences in us. Finally, if the claims that we experience genuine emotions towards artworks, and that we are not irrational in seeking out unpleasant experiences, can be made good, the question whether these emotional responses themselves are rational, justified, or proportional remains to be answered.

2. Emotion in Response to Representational Artworks: The Paradox of Fiction

Artworks can be roughly divided into those that are representational and those that are non-representational or abstract. Examples of the former include works of fiction, landscape paintings and pop music songs. Examples of the latter include expressionist paintings and works of instrumental or absolute music. Both kinds of artworks are commonly thought to arouse affective responses in audiences. The basic question is how best to describe such responses.

Starting with representational artworks, it isn’t clear how we can undergo genuine emotional responses towards things we believe not to exist in the first place (creating a tension with the belief requirement above). Taking the case of fiction as a paradigm case, we seem to come to the following paradox (first formulated by Radford, 1975):

  1. We experience genuine emotions directed at fictional characters and situations (fictional emotions condition).
  2. In order to experience an emotion towards X, one must believe that X exists (belief requirement).
  3. We do not believe that fictional characters and situations exist (disbelief condition).

Claims (1)-(3) being inconsistent, most theorists have tried to solve the paradox of fiction by rejecting one or more of these premises.

a. Denying the Fictional Emotions Condition

The fictional emotions condition (claim (1)) can be denied in two main ways. On the one hand, one could deny that the affective states we experience in the context of an encounter with fiction are genuine emotions. On the other hand, accepting that the affective states in question are genuine emotions, one could deny that such mental states are in fact directed at fictional characters and situations.

Regardless of how the debate over the nature of our affective responses to fiction turns out, one thing is clear: we can be moved by an encounter with fiction. It is difficult to deny that works of fiction tend to affect us in some way or other. One solution to the paradox of fiction is therefore to claim that the relevant affective states need not be genuine emotions but affective states of some other kind (for example, Charlton, 1970, 97). Some affective states or moods (like cheerfulness) and, perhaps, reflex-like reactions (surprise and shock), do not seem to require existential beliefs in order to occur and are in fact compatible with the presence of beliefs with any given content. There is certainly no contradiction in a state of mind involving both a gloomy mood and the belief that the characters described in fiction are purely fictional. An advantage of this view is that it explains why the responses we have towards fiction are very much emotion-like. Moods, for instance, are not typically ‘cold’ mental states but have a phenomenal character.

The major difficulty with approaches appealing to such seemingly non-cognitive or non-intentional states is that they only seem to account for a small part of the full range of affective states we experience in response to fiction (Levinson, 1997, 23, Neill, 1991, 55). It is quite clear that many of the affective states we have in response to fiction are experienced as directed towards some object or other. One’s sadness upon seeing a story’s main character die is, at the very least, felt as directed towards someone, be it the character himself, a real-world analogue of himself (for instance, a best friend), or any other known reference. An adequate solution to the paradox of fiction, therefore, should allow the affective states one feels in response to fiction to be genuinely intentional.

Another solution that denies that we experience genuine emotions towards fictional characters is the one given by Kendal Walton (1978). According to Walton, it is not literally true that we experience pity for the fictional character Anna Karenina, and it is not literally true that we experience fear at the view of the approaching green slime on the movie screen. Rather, we are in some sense pretending to be experiencing such emotions. It is only fictionally the case that we feel pity or fear in such contexts. As a result, the affective states we actually experience are not genuine emotions, but what Walton calls ‘quasi-emotions’. Just as one makes-believe that the world is infested with heartless zombies when watching Night of the Living Dead, or that one is reading the diary of Robinson Crusoe, one only makes-believe that one feels fear for the survivors, or sadness when Crusoe is having a bad day. Watching films and reading novels turn out very much like children’s games where objects are make-believedly taken to be something else (for example, children pretend to bake cookies using cakes of mud). In engaging with both fiction and children’s games, for Walton, we can only be pretending to be experiencing emotion.

Walton does not deny that we are genuinely moved by─or emotionally involved with─the world of fiction; he only denies that such affective states are of the garden-variety, that they should be described as genuine states of fear, pity, anger, and so on. This denial is backed up by two main arguments. First, in contrast with real-life emotions, quasi-emotions are typically not connected to behavior. We, indeed, do not get up on the theater stage in order to warn Romeo that he is about to make a terrible mistake. Second, in line with the belief requirement, Walton appeals to what seems to him a “principle of commonsense”, “one which ought not to be abandoned if there is any reasonable alternative, that fear must be accompanied by, or must involve, a belief that one is in danger.” (1978, 6-7)

Walton’s theory can be attacked on several fronts, but the most common strategy is to reject one or both of the arguments Walton gives. In response to the first argument, one could argue that emotions in general are not necessarily connected to motivation or behavior. For instance, emotions directed at the past, such as regret, are not typically associated with any particular sort of behavior. Of course, emotions can lead to behavior, and many of them include a motivational component, but it is not clear that such a component is a defining feature of emotion in general. Moreover, it is important to note that most works of fiction are composed of representations of certain events, and do not purport to create the illusion that we are in direct confrontation with them. The most natural class of real-world emotions comparable to the relevant affective states, is therefore, emotions experienced towards representations of real-world states of affairs (documentaries and newspapers), and not in contexts of direct confrontation with the relevant objects. Once this distinction─between emotion in response to direct confrontation and emotion in response to representations of real-world events─is made, it becomes apparent that the lack of distinctive behavioral tendencies in affective states produced by fiction should not count against the claim that they constitute genuine emotions. Assuming the claim that it is possible to feel genuine pity, sadness or anger upon reading or hearing the report of a true story, the relevant emotions need not, and typically do not, include a motivational component whose aim is to modify the world in some way. One can read the story of a Jewish family deported in the 1940’s, feel deep sadness in response to it, yet lack the desires to act, as in sadness that is evoked in contexts of direct confrontation. (See Matravers, 1998, Ch. 4, for elaboration.)

The second argument, relying on (something like) the belief requirement, can be rejected by denying the requirement itself. A reason in favor of rejecting the belief requirement instead of the fictional emotions conditions is that rejecting the latter leads to a view with the highly revisionary consequence that it is never the case that we respond to fictions with genuine emotion. This sort of strategy will be introduced in Section 2.b.

If one accepts the claim that fiction can trigger genuine emotions in audiences, but nonetheless does not wish to reject either the belief requirement or the disbelief condition, one can deny that the relevant emotions are directed at fictional entities in the first place. An alternative way to describe our emotions in response to fiction is to say that, although such emotions are caused by fictional entities, they are not directed at them. As Gregory Currie summarizes what is sometimes called the ‘counterpart theory’ (defended in, for instance, Weston, 1975 and Paskins, 1977),

…we experience genuine emotions when we encounter fiction, but their relation to the story is causal rather than intentional; the story provokes thoughts about real people and situations, and these are the intentional objects of our emotions. (1990, 188)

Given that the objects of the relevant emotions─particular people and situations, types of people and situations, the fictional work itself, certain real-world properties inspired by the fictional characters, as well as real human potentialities (Mannison, 1985)─both exist and are believed to exist, the view satisfies the belief requirement. In addition, the view is compatible with the plausible claim that we do not believe in the existence of fictional characters and situations (that is, the disbelief condition). Appealing to surrogate objects is in fact a way to do justice to it.

Despite its elegance and simplicity, this solution to the paradox of fiction does not find a lot of proponents. It manages to capture some of the affective states, but not all. More specifically, the example of appealing to objectless affective states, fails to capture those affective states that are experienced as directed at the fictional characters and situations themselves. To many philosophers, it is simply a datum of the phenomenology of our responses to fiction that these are sometimes directed at the characters and situations themselves. It is precisely these responses that initially called for explanation.
"For we do not really weep for the pain that a real person might suffer”, says Colin Radford, “and which real persons have suffered, when we weep for Anna Karenina, even if we should not be moved by her story if it were not of that sort. We weep for her." (Radford, 1975, 75) An adequate theory of our emotional responses to fiction that appeals to surrogate objects, as a result, owes us an account of why we may be mistaken in thinking otherwise.

b. Denying the Belief Condition

The rejection of the claim that we can respond to fictional characters and situations with genuine emotions, and that such emotions can be genuinely directed at the latter, seems to clash with a rather stable commitment of commonsense. In recent years, the dominant approach has rather been to reject the belief requirement (claim (2)).

One reason why one might deny that the affective states we have in response to fiction are genuine emotions is an acceptance, explicit or implicit, of a certain theory of emotion. According to the so-called ‘cognitive’ theory of emotion (sometimes called ‘judgmentalism’), an emotion necessarily involves the belief or judgment that the object of the emotion instantiates a certain evaluative property (see examples in Lyons, 1980. Solomon, 1993). In this view, an episode of fear would necessarily involve the belief or judgment that one is in danger. This resembles the ‘principle of commonsense’ that Walton speaks of when he claims that “fear must be accompanied by, or must involve, a belief that one is in danger” (1978, 6-7). If emotions are, or necessarily involve, evaluative beliefs about the actual, it is no wonder that they require existential beliefs. The belief that a given big dog constitutes a threat, for instance, seems to entail the belief that the dog exists. Rejecting the cognitive theory, as a result, may seem to be a way to cast doubt on the belief requirement.

The cognitive theory of emotion is widely rejected for well-known reasons. One of them is the counterintuitive consequence that one would be guilty of a radical form of irrationality every time one’s emotions turn out to conflict with one’s judgments, as in cases of phobic fears (Tappolet, 2000, Döring, 2009). Another reason to reject the cognitive theory is that it may lead to the denial that human infants and non-human animals cannot experience emotions, since they plausibly lack the necessary level of cognitive sophistication (Deigh, 1994). Ultimately, many people seem to think, the theory is too ‘intellectualist’ to be plausible (Goldie, 2000, Robinson, 2005).

It is one thing to reject the cognitive theory of emotion, however, quite another to reject the belief requirement. Although the two views are closely related and are often held together (since the cognitive theory implies the belief requirement, at least understood as a requirement of rationality─see below), the falsity of the cognitive theory does not entail the falsity of the belief requirement. What the latter says is that, no matter how an emotion is to be ultimately defined, the having of one requires that the subject believe that its object exists. As Levinson says,

The sticking point of the paradox of fiction is the dimension of existence and nonexistence, as this connects to the cognitive characterization that emotions of the sort in question minimally require. When we view or conceive an object as having such and such properties, whether or not we strictly believe that it does, we must, on pain of incoherence, be taking said object to exist or be regarding it as existence. For nothing can coherently be viewed or conceived as having properties without at the same time being treated as existent. (1997, 24-25)

It is a mistake, therefore, to think that a simple rejection of the cognitive theory of emotion can solve the paradox of fiction. What one must do is confront the belief requirement directly.

The main way to challenge the belief requirement is to claim that, although our emotional responses to events in the world require the presence of some cognitive states, such states need not be beliefs. On such a view, sometimes called the “thought theory” (Lamarque, 1981, Carroll, 1990), one need not believe that an object O exists in order to be afraid of it; rather, one must at least entertain the thought that O exists (Carroll, 1990, 80), or imagine what O would be like if it existed (Novitz, 1980), or ‘alieve’ O being a certain way (see Gendler, 2008, for the distinction between alief and belief). We surely are capable of responding emotionally as a result of thought processes that fall short of belief, as when we are standing near a precipice and entertaining the thought that we may fall over (Carroll, 1990, 80. Robinson, 2005).

Thoughts, according to Lamarque and Carroll, can generate genuine emotions. On their view, the vivid imagining of one’s lover’s death can produce genuine sadness. It is important, however, to note that what the emotion is about─its intentional object─is not the thought itself, but what the thought is about (its ‘content’). In the case just given, one’s sadness is about one’s lover’s death, and not about the thought that one’s lover may die. Here, as in many everyday instances of emotion, the cause of one’s emotion need not coincide with its object, and the object of one’s emotion need not exist. As a result, the view preserves the claim that we can have genuine emotions directed towards fictional characters and situations.

Despite the fact that the thought theory (and its cognates─for example, Gendler’s view) enjoys a great deal of plausibility, in that it meshes quite well with recent orthodoxy in both the philosophy and the psychology of emotion in its claim that existential beliefs are not necessary for emotion in general (for a review, see Deonna & Teroni, 2012). It nonetheless appears to naturally lead to the claim that there is something utterly irrational, unreasonable, or otherwise wrong, in feeling fear, pity, joy, grief, and so on, both in response to mere thoughts, and for things that we know not to exist. If feeling pity for a fictional character is like feeling fear while imagining the possible crash of the plane one is taking (assuming flying the plane is a perfectly safe activity and one knows it), it becomes hard to see how one can be said to be rational in engaging emotionally with fiction, perhaps even to see where the value of doing so could lie. See Section 5 below.

When first presenting the paradox of fiction, Colin Radford decided to accept all the three premises of the alleged paradox and declared us ‘irrational’ in being moved by fiction. If one interprets the paradox as a logical paradox, that is as one in which the claims cannot all be true, then one would be led to the unpalatable thought that the world in itself includes some form of incoherence (Yanal, 1994). A more reasonable way to understand Radford’s decision to accept the three premises of the paradox, and in turn to declare us irrational, is to say that, as he understands them, they are not really inconsistent (they in fact can all be true). What interests Radford may not be so much how it is possible for audiences to feel emotions in response to fiction (although he must presuppose an answer to that question) than how it is possible for us to feel such emotions and be rational in doing so. An alternative way to read the belief requirement is, therefore, as a norm of rationality (Joyce, 2000). On such a reading, in order for an emotion to be fully appropriate or rational, it is necessary that the subject believe that the emotion’s object exists. A child’s fear of monsters in his bed at night may be irrational if the child does not believe that monsters in fact exist. Our emotional responses to fiction, although genuine, may be akin to such irrational fears of unreal entities.

It remains to be seen whether the belief requirement formulated as a norm of rationality (of a sort to be elucidated) is acceptable in the context of emotion in general, and in the context of emotion in response to artworks in particular. (See Section 5 below for further details.)

c. Denying the Disbelief Condition: Illusion and Suspension of Disbelief

Among all the strategies that have been adopted in response to the paradox of fiction, the least popular is the one that rejects the disbelief condition. There are two main ways to reject this condition.

The first way to reject the disbelief condition is to claim that, while watching films and reading novels, we are in some way under the illusion that the characters and situations depicted in them are real and we willfully suspend our disbelief in their existence (Coleridge, 1817), or simply forget, temporarily, that they do not exist.

The main problem with this solution is the notable behavioral differences between real-world responses and responses to fiction. If we were really suspending our disbelief we would behave differently than we actually do in our dealings with fictions. Another problem is the notion that we can suspend our disbelief at will in the context of fiction, seems to presuppose a capacity of voluntary control over our beliefs in the face of opposing evidence - a claim that surely needs a proper defense. See Doxastic Voluntarism, and Carroll, 1990, Ch.2, for further discussion. Finally, it may be partly due to the fact that we are aware that we are dealing with fiction that we can find pleasure, or some worth, in experiencing negative emotions towards fictional entities in the first place. (See section on Art and Negative Emotion: The Paradox of Tragedy.)

Currie (1990, 10) provides an alternative understanding of the notion of willful suspension of disbelief whereby it is occurrent, as opposed to dispositional disbelief that should be suppressed. What suspension of disbelief requires, for Currie, is merely that one, while engaged in a work of fiction, does not attend to the fact that the story is literally false. On such a view, a proper engagement with fictional stories, while allowing one to believe at some level that these stories are non-actual requires that one not bring this belief to consciousness. This solution, however, remains rather sketchy and may need to be supplemented with further details about the workings of the relevant mechanism. See Todd, forthcoming, for a proposal (in particular for the notion of bracketed beliefs).

The second way to reject the disbelief condition is by arguing that in some sense we do actually believe what the relevant stories tell us (rather than merely suspend our disbelief in the reality of their content), and therefore that the characters at play in them exist in some way. A plausible way to do so is to say that beliefs need not be directed at propositions about the actual and sometimes can be directed at propositions about what is fictionally the case. For instance, there does not seem to be anything wrong with the utterance “I believe that Sherlock Holmes lives in London”, and with the possibility of a genuine disagreement between the speaker and someone who believes that Holmes lives in Manchester. The fact that the relevant states are about a fictional entity does not give us a reason to deny them the status of beliefs. According to Alex Neill (1993), many of the types of emotion (pity, for example) we experience in response to fiction, require the presence of certain beliefs while leaving open the ontological status (actual vs. non-actual) of the entities involved in its content. On this account, what matters for pity, for instance, is not that a given character is believed to have actually existed, but that she is having a miserable time (in the fiction).

Whether an appeal to belief (as opposed to an appeal to make-beliefs, imaginings, attention mechanisms, and so on.) is the right way to capture the phenomenon is open for debate. Still, this solution not only seems to accommodate some of our intuitions, but also prompts us to further investigate the nature of the kinds of belief, if any, found in the context of an engagement with works of fiction. See Suits (2006) for further discussion.

3. Emotion in Response to Abstract Artworks: Music

Representational artworks are not the only ones capable of eliciting affective states in audiences; non-representational artworks can do so, too. One surely can be moved by a Beethoven’s Fifth Symphony or a Jackson Pollock’s No.5, 1948. A problem analogous to the problem of fiction can however be found in the case of abstract art. How can it be the case that we are moved by strings of sounds, or configurations of colors, when such entities do not represent anything, strictly speaking? Here, the question of what is the object of the relevant emotions is even more pressing than for fiction, as in this case there seems to be no characters and situations for an emotion to be about. Focusing on the case of (instrumental or absolute) music, two main questions should therefore be addressed. First, how should we classify our affective responses to music? Second, if such affective responses can be genuine emotions, what are their objects?

a. Moods, Idiosyncratic Responses and Surrogate Objects

As in the case of fiction, there are affective responses to music that may not pose any substantial philosophical problem. Such responses include seemingly non-cognitive or non-intentional states such as moods and feelings. Since moods are not directed at anything in particular, and can be triggered by a variety of things, including events, thoughts, and even certain chemical substances (such as caffeine), they do not constitute a problem in the context of our dealings with musical works. However, can genuine emotions be experienced in response to music? Intuitively, the answer is ‘of course’. The problem is precisely what kinds of emotion these can be and towards what they can be directed.

Some cases of genuine emotion in response to music that do not seem to be philosophically significant, moreover, are those emotions that we experience in response to music which can be explained by idiosyncratic facts about the subject. This is what Peter Kivy calls the ‘our-song phenomenon’ (Kivy, 1999, 4). A piece of music, for instance, may bring to one a host of memories that produce sadness. Here, as elsewhere, the intentional object of the emotion turns out not to be the music itself but what the memories are about (a lost love, say). Such cases are not philosophically puzzling, therefore, because they involve emotions whose object is not (or at least not exclusively) the music or the music’s properties.

Alternatively, one may fear that the loudness of a performance of Vivaldi’s Four Seasons might cause severe auditory damage. In such a case, although the music is the object of the emotion, the emotion is not in any way aesthetically relevant. It is not a response that is made appropriate by the music’s aesthetic properties. Furthermore, it is not a response that everyone is expected to experience in response to Vivaldi’s piece, as opposed to the particular performance of it in a specific context. (By analogy, one may be angry at the sight of a stain on the frame of the Mona Lisa; this, however, does not make anger an appropriate response to the painting as an object of aesthetic appraisal.)

What we need to know is whether there are cases of emotion that can claim to be aesthetically relevant in this intuitive way.

b. Emotions as Responses to Musical Expressiveness

It is commonly thought that musical works can be ‘sad’, ‘happy’, ‘melancholy’, perhaps even ‘angry’. In short, music appears capable of expressing, or being expressive of, emotions. One line of thought is that, just as we can respond to human expressions of emotion with genuine emotions, we can respond to music’s expressive properties with genuine emotions. In the case of human expressions of emotion, one can for instance react to someone’s sadness with genuine sadness, pity, or anger, the person (or the person’s distress) being the intentional object of one’s emotion. Likewise, if music can express sadness, one may respond to it by being sad (Davies, 1994, 279), something that seems to accord with common experience. The problem, of course, is in what sense music can be said to ‘express’ emotion in a way that would cause appropriate corresponding emotions in audiences. (The addition of the word ‘appropriate’ here is important, as one could agree that the relevant properties sometimes cause emotion─just as any (concrete) object can happen to cause emotion─but nonetheless consider them irrelevant to a proper appreciation of the work. For the view that all emotion elicited by musical works is pure distraction, see Zangwill, 2004.)

Of course, it is one thing to ask what musical expressiveness consists in; it is another thing to wonder about the nature of our affective response to musical works. One question addresses what makes it the case that a piece of music can be said to be ‘sad’, ‘joyful’ or ‘melancholy’, the other asks what makes it the case that we can feel emotions, if any, in response to a piece of music. As a result, nothing prevents one from answering these questions separately. Nevertheless, the various answers one might give to the question about musical expressiveness plausibly can have implications regarding the nature and appropriateness of our emotional responses to music’s expressive properties. If, for instance, the answer we give is that music can express emotions in roughly the same way humans do, then we are likely to count experiences of sadness in response to ‘sad’ music as appropriate. If, by contrast, we take the answer to be that music is expressive in an analogous way colors and masks can be expressive, we are likely to consider the affective states the relevant features tend to trigger either inappropriate (when feeling sadness directed at a work’s ‘sadness’) or of a sort that we don’t typically find in our responses to paradigmatic expression of human emotion.

Let’s call the claim according to which it is appropriate to react emotionally to music’s expressive properties in an analogous way it is appropriate to react emotionally to the expression of other people’s emotions, the expression-emotion link thesis (E), and the sorts of responses we typically (and appropriately) experience in response to the expression of human emotions─such as pity, sadness, compassion, or sympathy when someone is in a state of distress─‘empathetic emotions’. Accounts of musical expressiveness divide into those that naturally lead to the acceptance of (E) and those that naturally lead to its rejection (and perhaps to the denial that empathetic emotions are ever really felt in the context of an engagement with musical works).

i. Music as Expression of the Composer’s Emotions

The most obvious way to do justice to the thought that music’s expressiveness can appropriately arouse in its audience emotions that are analogous to those one would feel in response to a real person expressing her emotions is to say that music itself is a medium by which human emotions can express themselves. Music, on one such view, can express the emotions of the composer. So, if when we listen to music we listen to what we take to be the direct expression of the emotions of some real human being, then the usual emotions we can feel towards someone expressing emotion through facial expression, gestures, voice, and so on, are emotions we can feel in response to music. One problematic feature of this view is the highly robust link it makes between the mental states of the artist and the expressive properties of the music he or she produces. Little reflection suggests that it is just not true that whenever a musical work is ‘cheerful’, its composer was cheerful when composing it; a sad composer could have created the work just as well. Moreover, the view does not seem to do justice to our experience of musical works, as we typically do not, and need not, construe them as expressions of human emotion in order to be moved by them; our experience of musical works does not typically go beyond the sounds themselves, and probably not to the artist who produced them.

ii. Reacting Emotionally to Music’s Persona

One way to preserve the attractive thought that music can genuinely express emotions, and therefore that it may sometimes be appropriate to respond to it with empathetic emotions, is to claim that music can express emotion, not by virtue of it being produced by an artist experiencing emotion, but imagined as something or someone that expresses emotion. According to Jerrold Levinson (1990), when we listen to music that is expressive of emotion, we hear it as though someone─what he calls the music’s ‘persona’─were expressing the emotion of the music. Of course, the persona is not something that is or ought to be imagined in great detail; for instance, there is no need to attribute any specific physical characteristics to it. All that is needed is that something very much human-like be imagined as expressing human-like emotions. Now, if Levinson is right in claiming that music’s expressive properties are to be explained by an appeal to a persona that we imagine to be in the music, then there is less mystery in the possibility for audiences to experience genuine emotions in response to these properties. At the very least, there may be here as much mystery as in our ability to experience genuine emotions in response to the expression of emotion by fictional characters, and the solution one gives to the paradox of fiction may as a result be expandable so as to include the case of music. See Kivy, 2002, 116-117, for doubts about this strategy.

iii. Contour Accounts of Expressiveness and Appropriate Emotions

Regardless of the appeal of its conclusions, the persona theory relies on a psychological mechanism─imagining hearing a persona in the music─whose nature may need to be further clarified (see Davies, 1997, for problems for the persona account). An account of music’s expressive properties that posits no seemingly mysterious mechanism, and therefore that may seem less controversial, is what is sometimes called the ‘contour’ or ‘resemblance’ theory (examples can be found in Davies, 1994, Kivy, 1989). According to this view, music can be expressive of emotion in virtue of resembling characteristic expressions of human emotion, a resemblance that we seem pretty good at picking out. A heavy, slow-paced piece of music may, for instance, resemble the way a sad, depressed person would walk and behave, and it may be why we are tempted to call it ‘sad’ or ‘depressing’ in the first place. Musical works, on such a view, are analogous to colors, masks, and other things that we may call ‘happy’, ‘sad’, and so on, on the basis of their perceptible properties. A ‘happy’ song is similar to a smiling mask in that they both resemble in some way characteristic behavioral expressions of human emotion.

The contour theorist does not claim that music genuinely expresses emotion in the way that paradigmatically humans do (that is, by first experiencing an emotion, and then expressing it); rather, she claims that music can resemble expressions of human emotion, just as certain other objects can. Given that musical expressiveness is, on this view, different from paradigmatic human expression, we are led to conclude one of two claims: either the emotions we typically experience in response to music’s expressive properties are generally not of the same sort as the emotions we typically experience in response to other people’s expressions of emotion, or, whenever they are, they are inappropriate. The former claim is a descriptive claim about the nature of our emotional responses to music’s expressive properties; the latter claim is a normative claim about the sorts of responses music’s expressive properties require, if any. We will consider the descriptive claim in the next section.

Why does the contour theory naturally lead to the normative claim? The answer is that, just as it would be inappropriate to feel ‘empathetic’ emotions in response to the sadness of a mask or the cheerfulness of a color, it would be inappropriate to feel such emotions in response to the sadness, or the cheerfulness, of a piece of music. Unless we believe that what one is sad about when looking at a mask is not really the mask, we should be puzzled by one’s response, for, after all, nobody is (actually or fictionally) sad. (Of course, the mask may produce certain moods in one; this, however, would not constitute a problem, as we have seen.) The sadness, as a result, would count as an inappropriate response to its object.

Something similar may hold in the music case. Although there may be cases where sadness is an appropriate response to a musical work’s ‘sadness’ (for idiosyncratic reasons), this may not be a response that is aesthetically appropriate, that is, appropriate given the work’s aesthetic properties. No matter how often we respond emotionally to music’s expressive properties, these ultimately may count as mere distractions (Zangwill, 2004).

The plausibility of the contour account remains to be assessed. See Robinson, 2005, Ch. 10, for a critique. See also Neill, 1995, for the possibility of a positive role for feelings in attaining a deeper understanding of music’s expressiveness.

c. Music as Object

According to Peter Kivy (1990, 1999), there is an obvious object that can produce genuine emotions in audiences, namely the music itself. On his view, in addition to moods (with qualifications─see Kivy, 2006) and idiosyncratic emotions (the our-song phenomenon), music is capable of eliciting emotions in audiences that are both genuine (not ‘quasi-emotions’), aesthetically appropriate, and of the non-empathetic sort. When one is deeply moved by a musical work, one may be moved by its beauty, complexity, subtlety, grace, and any other properties predicated by the work (including its expressive properties, construed in terms of the contour account). According to Kivy, these emotions, which can collectively be put under the label ‘being moved’, are the only ones that count as appropriate in the relevant way. Moreover, they are not the ‘empathetic’ responses that were put forward in the aforementioned accounts. When we are moved by ‘sad’ music, what may move us is how beautifully, or gracefully the music is expressive of sadness, rather than by an alleged persona we may pity. This allows Kivy to explain why we can (rightly) fail to be moved by a musical work that is surely expressive of some emotion but is at the same time mediocre, a phenomenon that is left unexplained on alternative accounts (Kivy, 1999, 12). In addition, the account explains how music can be moving even when it lacks expressive properties altogether (ibid.).

According to Kivy, we are simply mistaken when thinking that whenever we experience a genuine emotion in response to a musical work, this emotion is of the same sort as the emotions we would feel in response to the expression of emotion in other people. It is simply not true, on his account, that music’s sadness produces in audiences a state of sadness (or other empathetic emotions) whose intentional object is its expressive property (or the entity, real or imagined, that allegedly produced it). What they feel instead is an emotion that, although directed at the music’s sadness, should not be characterized as sadness but instead as ‘exhilaration’, ‘wonder’, ‘awe’, ‘enthusiasm’, and other non-empathetic emotions. Even if the emotion is felt in response to music’s sadness, and may on occasion even feel like garden-variety empathetic emotions, Kivy states that first appearances may be deceptive.

Whether Kivy’s solution to the original problem (including his rejection of (E)), and its accompanying error theory, are adequate, is a matter of significant debate. (In any case, all parties may agree that it adequately captures some emotions that we can confidently count as appropriate responses to music.)

4. Art and Negative Emotion: The Paradox of Tragedy

Let’s assume that we regularly experience genuine emotions in response to fictional characters and situations, and that among the emotions we commonly experience are paradigmatic ‘negative’ emotions. (If one thinks that music can arouse such emotions as well, the following problem is a problem about music, too.) Now, to the extent that many of us are inclined to regularly pursue an engagement with works of fiction, and thereby things that tend to produce negative emotions in audiences, we have a problem in explaining how many of us could be motivated in pursuing activities that elicit in us such unpleasant states.

The paradox of tragedy (called the ‘paradox of horror’ in the specific context of horror─Carroll, 1990) arises when the three following theses are held simultaneously:

  1. We commonly do not pursue activities that elicit negative emotions.
  2. We often have negative emotions in response to fictional works.
  3. We commonly pursue an engagement with fictional works that we know will elicit negative emotions.

Notice that the so-called ‘paradox’ is not a formal paradox. Unless one defends a strong form of motivational hedonism─namely, the view that all we are motivated to pursue is pleasure and nothing else; see Hedonism─the fact that many of us pursue activities that produce painful experiences is not logically problematic. Rather, the problem is that of explaining why many of us are so eager to seek out an engagement with works of fiction when they know it will result in negative emotions and negative emotions are things they generally wish to avoid (all other things being equal). Alternatively, there is a problem in explaining the presence of the relevant motivation in the context of fiction when such motivation is arguably lacking in everyday life.

The solutions to the paradox of tragedy can be divided into two broad classes: those that appeal to pleasure in solving the paradox and those that appeal to entities other than pleasure.

a. Pleasure-Centered Solutions

A common way to characterize the paradox of tragedy is by asking how we can derive pleasure from artworks that tend to elicit unpleasant states in its audience. One solution is to say that the pain that may result from an engagement with fictional works is relatively insignificant or negligible. Another solution is to say that, although the pain that may result in such an engagement can be significant, it is nonetheless compensated by pleasure derived from either the work or some other source.

i. Negligible Pain

1. Conversion

Various mechanisms have been postulated in the history of philosophy in order to explain how we can sometimes derive pleasure from activities, such as watching tragedies and horror films, that tend to elicit unpleasant experiences in audiences. David Hume provides one such mechanism in his famous essay ‘Of Tragedy’. According to Hume, unpleasant emotional experiences are ‘converted’ into pleasant ones in response to positive aesthetic properties of the work such as the eloquence with which the events of the narrative are depicted. One’s overall initially unpleasant emotional state is thereby converted into a pleasant emotional state thanks to the ‘predominance’ of a positive emotion.

One of the main problems with this proposal is the absence of a clear account of the mechanism by which such conversion is made (Feagin, 1983, 95). Presumably, part of the initial overall experience─the pain─is removed and replaced by another part─the pleasure. This, however, demands explanation as to how such an operation can be performed. If the operation is not that there is first a negative emotion and thereafter a positive emotion that somehow compensates for the first’s unpleasantness (which would make Hume’s view a variant of the ‘compensation’ solution; see below), then what is it precisely?

Another problem with the conversion theory is that it seems to fail to allow for cases where people are motivated to engage with works of fiction that they know will on the whole lead to more pain than pleasure, but that may still provide them with some valuable experience (Smuts, 2007, 64). (See section on Non-Pleasure-Centered Solutions below.)

2. Control

Hume’s theory is meant to account for the possibility of deriving pleasure from an engagement with fictional works eliciting negative emotions. This view assumes that we do tend to experience unpleasant emotions in response to fiction; it is just that the unpleasant part of the emotions is modified in the course of the engagement so as to make the overall experience a pleasant one.

An alternative way to view our engagement with works of fiction is as in fact rarely involving any significantly unpleasant states in the first place. On a recent family of solutions, it is a fact of life that we are able to enjoy, under certain conditions, putative ‘negative’ emotions. According to one version of this solution, the ‘control theory’ (Eaton, 1982, Morreall, 1985), the relevant conditions are those where we enjoy some suitable degree of control over the situation to which we are attending. The thought is that, whenever we think that the situation is one over which we can have a fair degree of control, the negative emotions that we may feel in response to it would be felt as less painful than they would otherwise be. For instance, the fear that a professional mountain climber, a skydiver, a roller-coaster user, or a horror film lover, may feel, may be painful to such an insignificant extent that it may turn out to be enjoyable. The reason why the relevant experiences are enjoyable, on this view, is that the subjects are confident that they can handle the situation appropriately. In the fictional case, one can certainly leave the movie theater, or close the book, at any time, and therefore stop being confronted with the work, whenever it becomes unbearable (for example, when it depicts extreme violence).

One worry with the present solution is that, in its current form at least, it still leaves it rather mysterious why we are able to derive pleasure from even mildly unpleasant affective states. The control theorist does not deny that the relevant emotions are to some degree unpleasant. The problem is that she fails to provide us with an account as to why we would want to have such experiences in the first place. What’s so enjoyable about feeling a little pain? As Aaron Smuts puts it, “If we feel any pain at all, then the question of why we desire such experiences, why we seek out painful art, is still open.” (Smuts, 2007, 66)

Another worry is that the view may not have the resources to explain why some people, and not others, pursue activities that tend to elicit unpleasant experiences, when everyone enjoys the relevant control (Gaut, 1993, 338). The fact that people have some control over their responses may well be a prerequisite for the possibility of finding pleasure in them, but it does not seem to explain why such pleasure is to be had in the first place. As alternatively put, although confidence that one will have the capacity to exercise some degree of control may be necessary in order to have the relevant motivation, it is surely insufficient. The control theory therefore requires further elaboration.

3. No Essential Valence

One way to solve the paradox of tragedy by relying on the idea that we can enjoy negative emotions is by denying an assumption that was made when we initially posed the problem, namely that the ‘negative’ emotions we feel in response to fiction are necessarily unpleasant states (Walton, 1990, Neill, 1993). One problem with control theories, we saw, is that they fail to explain why we should even enjoy mild instances of pain. The present solution, by contrast, does not claim that the emotions we experience involve any such pain. More generally, the view denies that emotion as such essentially involves valence (as in the valence thesis above). According to Kendall Walton and Alex Neill, when responding emotionally to an undesirable situation, we may confuse the undesirability of the situation with the perceived nature of the emotion, thereby thinking that it is the emotion that is unpleasant. “What is clearly disagreeable”, Walton says, “what we regret, are the things we are sorrowful about –the loss of an opportunity, the death of a friend─not the feeling or experience of sorrow itself.” (Walton, 1990, 257) Neill goes a step further, making the claim that what we actually mean when we say that an emotion is painful or unpleasant, is that an emotion in these terms is in fact attributing the relevant properties (painfulness, unpleasantness, and so on) to the situations themselves (Neill, 1992, 62).

The major problem for such a view, of course, is that it seems to radically run counter to common sense in holding that emotions do not in themselves feel good or bad. There certainly appears to be a fairly robust conceptual connection between certain emotion types and felt qualities that can be described as pleasure and pain. Perhaps, however, one could maintain that, although such a conceptual connection exists, it is not so strong as to rule out exceptions. For such a possibility, see Gaut, 1993.

ii. Compensation

The second class of solutions that appeal to pleasure, in solving the paradox of tragedy, take the pain involved in our engagement with fiction to be genuine, sometimes even significant, but take this pain to be compensated by some pleasure experienced in response to either the work or some other source.

1. Intellectual Pleasure

One general solution to the paradox of tragedy is to say that, although works of fiction can surely elicit unpleasant states in audiences, they can also elicit pleasant ones. An explanation for why we are motivated to engage with such works is that they usually elicit states that are on the whole more pleasant than unpleasant.

A version of this solution is the one defended by Noel Carroll in his book on horror (Carroll, 1990). Carroll argues that monsters, such as vampires and werewolves, often violate our categorial schemes. In doing so, they unsurprisingly can look threatening, scary, and disgusting, explaining in turn why we can experience emotions such as fear and disgust towards them. However, in challenging our categorial schemes, monsters can also trigger our curiosity. Monsters are indeed things that fascinate us. According to Carroll, the pleasure that is derived from our getting to know more about them can compensate for the unpleasant states we may initially experience, particularly when the narration is such as to arouse our curiosity. The pain is for Carroll “the price to be paid for the pleasure of [the monsters’] disclosure” (1990, 184).

One problem with Carroll’s view is that not all horror stories involve monsters, that is, things that challenge our categorial schemes in the way that werewolves do. Psychopaths and serial killers, for instance, do not seem to be monsters in this sense; they are, as Berys Gaut says, “instances of an all-too-real phenomenon” (Gaut, 1993, 334). Carroll, however, could give up his appeal to monsters in particular, and claim rather that the relevant characters in the horror genre have the ability to elicit our curiosity and the resulting intellectual pleasures.

A more serious problem is that Carroll’s explanation does not seem to be adequate when we go beyond the particular case of horror. The fact that we enjoy watching drama films does not seem to be explainable solely in terms of our curiosity and fascination for odd characters. One possible response to this worry is that intellectual pleasures need not be derived from the satisfaction of our curiosity, and that such pleasures can rather be derived from a variety of sources, including things that do not elicit our curiosity. One problem with this solution would be why the relevant pleasures should be exclusively intellectual, rather than (say) both intellectual and affective. (See Affective Mixture.) In addition, the proponent of this solution may need to motivate the thought that it is in virtue of the pleasures they produce that the relevant intellectual states (such as learning about the characters) are valuable to us, as opposed to the fact that such states are intrinsically valuable. Why should it be the pleasure that one has as a result of learning about the personality of a work’s characters that is the primary motivating factor in our engaging with fiction? Why can it not be the fact that one, say, is able to get a new perspective on what it is to be human, regardless of whether the painful experiences that one may undergo are compensated by pleasant ones? (See Non-Pleasure-Centered Solutions.)

2. Meta-Response

Susan Feagin (1983), another proponent of the compensatory solution, argues that we are motivated to engage with works of fiction that elicit negative emotions, not because the works themselves elicit pleasant experiences in greater proportion, but because of certain responses that we have towards the negative emotions themselves. In a nutshell, for Feagin, an awareness of the fact that we are the kind of people to experience, for instance, pity for Anna Karenina, results in a pleasurable state that compensates for the painful emotions that we have. It feels good, on this view, to realize that we care about the right things.

This solution suffers from a number of problems. First, it does not appear to be applicable to all the relevant cases, such as horror fictions. Many works of horror fiction certainly do not involve ‘sympathetic’ emotions such as pity, and involve rather fear and disgust. Furthermore, it doesn’t seem right to say that, when we experience fear and disgust in response to horror, we enjoy the fact that we are the kind of people to feel fear and disgust.

A second problem with Feagin’s view concerns its appeal to the notion of a meta-response. One thing to notice is that it does not sit well with the phenomenology of our engagement with many fictions. When watching a movie involving a serial killer, our attention is mostly focused on the events depicted, and rarely on ourselves; when we feel sad for an innocent character that has been killed, we do not seem to be sad for her and enjoy being the kind of person who can be sad for innocent people who have been murdered. Such a thought, it seems, rarely occurs to us. Of course, such self-congratulatory thoughts may occur, and may sometimes contribute to one’s overall enjoyment of the work, but they don’t seem necessary for it to be the case that one enjoys fictional works that elicit unpleasant experiences.

3. Catharsis

On one popular understanding of Aristotle’s famous theory of catharsis (see Lucas, 1928), the major motivation behind our desire to watch tragedy is that, by experiencing negative emotions, we are in turn able to expel them (by letting them go away), which somehow provides us with a pleasurable state. It is not, on such a view, the negative emotions that are pleasurable, but the fact that, after having been experienced, they are purged.

One issue this solution fails to address is that the pleasure that one derives from the experience of an unpleasant state terminated (as when one stops having a toothache after taking medicine) compensates for the unpleasantness of the state one was initially in. Moreover, the proponent of the catharsis solution must tell us why the relief that one gets from the extinction of the painful experiences is what typically motivates us in pursuing an engagement with the relevant fictional works. The fact that one will suffer for some time but then be ‘healed’ in a way that is very pleasant hardly sounds like a reason for one to accept to undergo the suffering in the first place. (For further reading, see Smuts, 2009, 50-51.)

Perhaps Aristotle meant to capture a different phenomenon by appealing to the notion of purgation, however. For instance, he could have taken purgation to involve emotions that people unconsciously had before engaging with the work, and that the work would help express themselves, leading to a pleasurable ‘release’ of some inner tension. Despite its possible intuitive appeal, such a solution remains to be developed in a clear and convincing way. (See Aristotle: Poetics for further details.)

4. Affective Mixture

The final pleasure-centered compensatory view that is worth mentioning holds that it does not really matter what kind of experience is supposed to compensate for the pain involved in the negative emotions; what is important is that there be some such experience. For instance, the negative emotions that we feel in response to a drama may be compensated by the joy we experience in realizing that it has a happy ending. Relief may often play a role as well, as when we are relieved that the main character is not going to die after all, something we were afraid would happen throughout the movie or novel.

The view, moreover, does not deny that something like the purgation of certain negative emotions may sometimes elicit pleasurable states. As Patricia Greenspan, a defender of this view, says, “it is not the release of fear that is pleasurable, at least in immediate terms, but that fact that one is soon released from it.” (1988, 32) However, the view denies that this is the only way painful states can be compensated. Such states can be compensated by any positive affective state that is called for by the work: joy, relief, a pleasant sense of immunity, the pleasure of having had a meaningful experience, admiration, and perhaps even self-congratulatory meta-responses. What matters, on this view, is the fact that some pleasant state or other is sufficiently strong to compensate for any unpleasant state the audience may otherwise have.

One advantage of the view is that it readily explains why people sometimes have to close the book they’re reading, or leave the movie theater: they have reached a point where the unpleasant emotions they experience have attained such a level of intensity that they don’t think the work could in any way compensate for them. In addition, the account has a straightforward explanation of why some of us do not like genres, such as horror, that tend to elicit negative emotions in audiences: the positive experiences they have, if any, do not typically compensate for the negative ones.

Another advantage of the present account is its ability to be applied to a wide range of cases, from horror and tragedy to drama and soap opera. Given that it allows a variety of mental states to play the compensatory role, it is less vulnerable to counter-examples.

The main problem with such a view, as with all pleasure-centered views, is simply that not all works of fiction that we are motivated to engage with succeed in compensating for the unpleasant states they elicit in the relevant way and may even leave us utterly depressed or disturbed. For example, Albert Camus’ The Stranger does not seem to elicit many pleasant experiences in readers, at any rate none that are likely to compensate for the pain elicited; many people who fully know what to expect may nevertheless be motivated to read it, suggesting that pleasure is not always what we are trying to get when pursuing an engagement with works of fiction. Pleasure may not be the only thing that negative emotions can buy.

b. Non-Pleasure-Centered Solutions

According to recent proposals, we beg the question if we assume that the paradox of tragedy asks us to explain how we can take pleasure in response to artworks eliciting negative responses in audiences. Unless we are committed to a form of motivational hedonism according to which nothing other than pleasure can account for the pervasiveness of the motivation to engage with works of fiction eliciting negative emotions, the question arises as to whether some other factor(s) may play the relevant motivating role.

We may sometimes find ourselves in conflict between going to see a movie that, although depressing, may teach us some valuable lessons about life, and doing some less painful activity (such as watching comedy). If we end up choosing to see the depressing movie, it is clearly not because one is hoping that it will give one more pleasure than pain. The pain may indeed be the cost of gaining something of value, regardless of whether the having of that thing turns out to be pleasurable.

Below are examples of theories that do not take pleasure to be the main, or the only, factor that explains our willingness to engage with works of fiction eliciting negative emotions. Notice that they can be viewed as compensatory theories that do not primarily appeal to pleasure.

i. ‘Relief from Boredom’ and Rich Experience

A clear example of the kind of view under discussion is one that Hume introduces and rejects in his essay on tragedy, and that he attributes to L’Abbé Dubos. According to Dubos, the thing that we most want when we pursue an engagement with tragedy is a ‘relief from boredom’. As life can sometimes be dull, he thinks, we may find it better to feel any emotion, even negative ones, as long as it delivers us from our boredom.

Dubos’ view is attractive for a number of reasons. First, it is very simple in that it explains the motivation we have to engage with tragedy by appealing to a single overarching desire: the desire to avoid boredom. Second, it makes it possible for people to pursue an engagement with works of fiction that they know will not elicit positive experiences that would compensate for the negative ones.

Of course, it is doubtful that a desire to avoid boredom is actually the underlying motivation behind all engagements with tragedy. Even if Dubos’ proposal does not work, it still provides a recipe for constructing a number of plausible views. If the desire to avoid boredom is not the relevant overarching desire, this does not mean that there is no such desire to be found. For instance, it could be the case that the relevant desire is the desire to have meaningful experiences, whatever their specific nature. According to a recent proposal (Smuts, 2007), when we engage in works of fiction such as tragedies and horror films, what we essentially desire is to get a ‘rich’ experience out of it. This experience, moreover, can be provided by a variety of mental states, including learning about certain characters, having our desire to avoid boredom fulfilled, having a sense of security (since, after all, the events depicted in fictional works are not real), feeling alive, and any other valuable mental state that can be had in the context of an encounter with the work. In addition, such mental states need not be particularly pleasant ones, as when one is being made aware of certain nasty truths about human nature.

One might wonder why there is a focus on experience here, in addition to what the notion of experience at play here is supposed to amount to. It is perfectly conceivable that some consumers of painful fiction are motivated to engage with it for non-experiential reasons. It is not the fact that they will have valuable experiences per se that may motivate them, but the fact that they will acquire certain valuable states whose phenomenology need not be experienced as intrinsically valuable. For instance, one can be reluctant to learn sad truths about the world via literature, but nonetheless pursue this activity because the relevant knowledge is valuable in its own right. Of course, the acquisition of the relevant knowledge may be experienced as meaningful or valuable, but it may not be what one ultimately pursues. One possible response from the rich response theorist is that, by and large, people (or, perhaps, people who are motivated by distinctively aesthetic or artistic considerations) are predominantly motivated to pursue an engagement with artworks eliciting unpleasant emotions because they will provide them with some valuable experience. This, however, would prevent the rich experience theorist from generalizing her account to all cases of painful activities that we are motivated in pursuing. (See next section.)

ii. Pluralism about Reasons for Emotional Engagement

An alternative way to solve the paradox of tragedy is not by appealing to an overarching desire, though such a desire may ultimately exist, but to simply accept that there are many motivating reasons for which we pursue an engagement with the relevant fictions. Like the rich experience theory, such a pluralist solution does not deny that pleasure may sometimes be a motivating factor. What matters however is that we expect from an engagement with any particular work of fiction more benefits than costs, benefits that can be realized by a variety of things: knowledge (including ‘sad truths’), a sense of being alive, an avoidance of boredom, an appreciation of aesthetic properties—any value that can be gained from an interaction with the relevant work. Pluralism about the reasons motivating our engagement with tragedy, therefore, differs from the rich experience theory in that it remains non-committal regarding the existence of an overarching desire under which all these reasons may fall.

The pluralist solution, notably, not only explains why we are motivated to engage with works of fiction that elicit negative emotions in audiences, it also seems to have the resources to provide an explanation for why we are motivated to pursue any activity that tends to elicit negative emotions. Why are some motivated to practice bungee jumping, mountain climbing, fasting, and any other activity that one can think of and that involves displeasure to some non-negligible extent? Because, presumably, it has some positive value that compensates for the displeasure that one may experience, positive value that need not be realized by pleasure. In contrast to the rich experience theory, furthermore, the pluralist solution does not place any constraint on the kind of thing whose positive value may compensate for the displeasure we may experience in the relevant contexts; it indeed does not even have to be a mental state. This is partly what makes an extension of the pluralist solution possible. To take a mundane case, getting one’s wisdom teeth removed may be valuable, and therefore something we may be motivated to pursue, despite the unpleasant side-effects, not merely because one will have pleasurable or other valuable experiences in the future, but partly because doing so contributes positively to one’s health.

Whether the paradox of tragedy may ultimately be part of a broader phenomenon, and, if so, whether it should nonetheless be solved in a way that is special to it, are matters for further discussion.

5. The Rationality of Audience Emotion

As hinted at in our discussion of the paradox of fiction, it is one thing to establish that we are capable of experiencing genuine emotions in response to fictional characters and situations (and perhaps in response to expressive properties of musical works, depending on one’s view on the matter); it is quite another thing to establish that such responses are rational. Colin Radford, let’s recall, attempted to solve the paradox by declaring us irrational in experiencing the relevant emotions. After all, for him, since there is nothing to be afraid, sad, or angry about, having such emotions in the context of an encounter with fictional characters cannot be as rational as having them in the context of an encounter with real people. If our emotions in response to artworks fall short of being fully rational, the worry therefore goes, it becomes hard to see where their apparent value could really lie. Are our emotional responses to fiction in any way justifiable?

Let’s distinguish two broad kinds of justification that emotions can be thought to have. On the one hand, emotions can be epistemically justified in the sense that they give us an accurate representation of the world; the fact that emotions can be rational in this way (at least in principle) is a straightforward consequence of their being cognitive or representational states. On the other hand, emotions can be justified by non-epistemic reasons. For instance, a given instance of anger, with its characteristic expressions, can turn out to be useful in scaring potential threats away.

Presumably, when Radford declared us ‘irrational’ in experiencing emotions in response to entities that we believe do not exist, he meant that there is something epistemically wrong with them. By analogy, there is arguably something wrong from an epistemological standpoint with someone who is afraid of a harmless spider precisely because the spider does not constitute a real threat.

One way to deny that emotions in response to fiction (and representational artworks generally) are irrational in the relevant sense is by saying that the epistemic norms to which they ought to comply are in some way different from those at play in the case of belief. Whereas it would be wrong to believe that there is such a person as Sherlock Holmes after having read Conan Doyle’s novels, it may nonetheless be epistemically acceptable to experience admiration for him. The difference between the epistemic norms governing belief and those governing emotion may lie in the fact that those governing the latter put a lower threshold on what counts as adequate evidence than those governing the former. (See Greenspan, 1988, and Gilmore, 2011, for discussion.)

It seems plausible that some emotions at least are epistemically appropriate responses to the content of fictional stories. In many cases, emotions seem required for a proper appreciation and understanding of the work. Reading War and Peace without experiencing any emotion whatsoever hardly makes possible the kind of understanding that is expected of the reader. Furthermore, it appears quite intuitive to say that, without emotion, an appreciation of the aesthetic qualities of certain artworks, such as those possessed by their narrative structure, would be at best highly impoverished. Radford could reply however that such emotions are uncontroversial, as they are directed at properties of the work rather than at its fictional content. The problem with this response is that even such emotions may need to rely on prior emotions that have been directed at the content of the work.

Even if the emotions we experience in response to fictional artworks are epistemically irrational, they still may be rational in respects that are not epistemic. The point of departure of such a claim is that there is a sense in which the relevant emotions are not completely irrational; they sometimes make perfect sense. As a result, perhaps their value lies in their enabling us to achieve either non-epistemic goods or knowledge about the actual world (as opposed to some putative fictional world). An example of a non-epistemic good may be what can be roughly called spiritual growth. It is commonly thought that literature can somehow educate its audience, not by giving it information about the world, but by playing with its emotions in a way that is beneficial. It seems certainly right that fictions, by presenting us novel situations, can condition our emotions by making us feel what we would not have in real-life situations. Moreover, fiction may enable its audiences to experience empathetic emotions towards types of characters (and their situations) of which they may have no significant knowledge prior to the engagement with the work, contributing potentially to certain openness to the unknown. (It is worth noting that this may provide an additional reason to favor the non-pleasure-centered solutions to the paradox of tragedy introduced above.) Additionally, given the capacity of fictions to modify our emotional repertoire, thereby potentially modifying our values, some philosophers have emphasized the genuine possibility of acquiring moral knowledge by means of an engagement with fiction. See Nussbaum, 1992, for a discussion on the ways literature can contribute to moral development.

It is worth pointing out dangers that are commonly thought to be at play in the fact that we regularly engage emotionally with fictional entities. Certain works of fiction, for instance, such as some works of drama, are designed to arouse very intense emotional responses in audiences. Some of us may feel that there is something wrong, indeed highly sentimental, with indulging in such activities. Perhaps this is because of a norm of proportionality that is at play in our judgment; perhaps this is because of another norm. In any case, sentimentality is often taken to be a bad thing. See Tanner, 1976, for a classic discussion.

In addition to sentimentality, one may worry that works of fiction have the ability to arouse in audiences ‘sympathetic’ feelings for morally problematic characters (see Feagin, 1983), and perhaps in the long run be detrimental to one’s moral character. Whether this is true, however, is an empirical question that cannot be answered from the armchair.

Whether or not the experience of emotions in response to artworks is on the whole rational remains a very live question, a question that, given the irresistible thought that artworks are valuable partly because of the emotional effect they have on us, is of prime importance. (See Matravers, 2006, for further discussion.)

6. Conclusion

There are at least three main problems that arise at the intersection of emotions and the arts. The first problem is that of explaining how it is possible to experience genuine emotions in response to fictional events and non-representational strings of sounds. The second problem is finding a rationale for our putative desire to engage with works of art that systematically trigger negative affective states in us (regardless of whether such states count as genuine emotions). Assuming the claim that works of art do sometimes trigger genuine emotions in us, the third problem is the problem whether the relevant responses can be said to be rational (given that, after all, they are systematically directed at non-existent or non-meaningful entities). We have seen that each of these problems admits more or less plausible answers that may require a revision of our pre-theoretical beliefs about emotion, on the one hand, and artworks, on the other. Whether a non-revisionary solution to each of these problems is possible, and whether its lack of non-revisionary implications would give this solution the upper hand over alternative solutions, are questions the reader is encouraged to consider.

It is worth emphasizing that the list of problems this article deals with is far from exhaustive. One promising avenue of research is the thorough study of the relationship between emotions and other mental capacities, including imagination. Of particular interest in this area is the phenomenon of imaginative resistance whereby an audience is reluctant to imaginatively engage with fictional works that require them to imagine situations that run contrary to its moral beliefs (such as a world where the torture of innocents is morally permissible). Given that imaginative resistance plausibly implies the presence of certain emotions, such as indignation and guilt, and the absence of others, such as joy and pride, we can legitimately ask what is the precise relationship between our reluctance to imagine certain states of affairs and the emotional responses that are often found to accompany this reluctance (see, for instance, Moran, 1994). If emotion turned out to play a role in the explanation of imaginative resistance in response to fiction, this would give us strong ground for taking the relationship between emotion, fiction, and morality very seriously.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Budd, M. (1985). Music and the Emotions. Routledge
    • A forceful attack of the major theories on the relationship between music and emotion.
  • Carroll, N. (1990). The Philosophy of Horror. New York: Routledge
    • A classic discussion on the nature of our responses to horror films.
  • Charlton, W. (1970). Aesthetics. London: Hutchinson
    • Dated but useful introduction to aesthetics.
  • Coleridge, S.T. ([1817] 1985). Biographia Literaria, ed. Engell, J. & Bate, W.J. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Currie, G. (1990). The Nature of Fiction. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
    • A classic treatment of the nature of fiction. Includes a chapter on the paradox of fiction.
  • Davies, S. (1994). Musical Meaning and Expression. Ithaca: Cornell University Press
    • Important contribution to the debate over the nature of musical expressiveness.
  • Davies, S. (1997). “Contra the Hypothetical Persona in Music”, in Hjort, M. & Laver, S. (eds.), Emotion and the Arts. New York: Oxford University press. 95-109
    • A forceful attack on the persona theory of musical expressiveness.
  • Deigh, J. (1994). “Cognitivism in the Theory of Emotions”, Ethics, 104, 824-854
    • A classic critique of the cognitive theory of emotion.
  • Deonna, J.A. & Teroni, F. (2012). The Emotions: A Philosophical Introduction. New York: Routledge
    • An excellent introduction to the philosophy of emotion.
  • Döring, S. (2009). “The Logic of Emotional Experience: Non-Inferentiality and the Problem of Conflict Without Contradiction”, Emotion Review, 1, 240-247
    • An article where a problem to the cognitive theory of emotion is exposed.
  • Eaton, M. (1982). “A Strange Kind of Sadness”, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 41, 51-63
    • A response to the paradox of tragedy appealing to control.
  • Feagin, S. (1983). “The Pleasures of Tragedy”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 20, 95-104
    • Develops a response to the paradox of tragedy in terms of meta-response.
  • Gaut, B. (1993). “The Paradox of Horror”, British Journal of Aesthetics, 33, 333-345
    • A thorough response to Noel Carroll’s treatment of our responses to works of horror.
  • Gendler, T.S. (2008). “Alief and Belief”, Journal of Philosophy, 105, 10, 634-663
    • Article where the distinction between alief and belief is defended and developed.
  • Gendler, T.S. & Kovakovich, K. (2006). “Genuine Rational Fictional Emotions”, in Kieran, M. (ed.), Contemporary Debates in Aesthetics and the Philosophy of Art. Blackwell. 241-253
    • An article dealing with the paradox of fiction. Argues that our responses to fictional works are rational.
  • Gilmore, J. (2011). “Aptness of Emotions for Fictions and Imaginings”, Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 92, 4, 468-489
    • An article dealing with the topic of appropriateness of emotions in fictional and imaginative contexts.
  • Goldie, P. (2000). The Emotions: A Philosophical Exploration. Oxford: Oxford University Press
    • A classic text in the philosophy of emotion. Defends the claim that the cognitive theory of emotions is too ‘intellectualist’.
  • Greenspan, P. (1988). Emotions and Reasons. New York: Routledge
    • Explores the relationship between emotions and rationality.
  • Hjort, M. & Laver, S. (eds.) (1997). Emotion and the Arts. New York: Oxford University Press
    • An excellent collection of papers on the relationship between emotions and artworks.
  • Joyce, R. (2000). “Rational Fears of Monsters”, British Journal of Aesthetics, 21, 291-304
    • An article construing the paradox of fiction as a paradox of rationality rather than logic.
  • Kivy, P. (1989). Sound Sentiment: An Essay on the Musical Emotions. Philadelphia: Temple University Press
    • Classic contribution to the philosophy of music, in particular to the topic of emotions in music.
  • Kivy, P. (1990). Music Alone: Philosophical Reflections on the Purely Musical Experience. Ithaca: Cornell University Press
    • Classic contribution to the philosophy of music. Revival of formalism in music theory.
  • Kivy, P. (1999). “Feeling the Musical Emotions”, British Journal of Aesthetics, 39, 1-13
    • An article expressing clearly Kivy’s views on the relationship between music and emotion.
  • Kivy, P. (2002). Introduction to a Philosophy of Music. Oxford: Oxford University Press
    • A good introduction to the philosophy of music, and to Kivy’s views on it.
  • Kivy, P. (2006). “Mood and Music: Some Reflections on Noël Carroll”, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 64, 2, 271-281
    • A good place to find Kivy’s views on moods in response to music.
  • Lamarque, P. (1981). “How Can We Fear and Pity Fictions”, British Journal of Aesthetics, 21, 291-304
    • Classic article developing the thought theory as a response to the paradox of fiction.
  • Levinson, J. (1990). Music, Art, and Metaphysics: Essays in Philosophical Aesthetics. Ithaca: Cornell University Press
    • A classic book in analytic aesthetics. Includes a chapter on music and negative emotion.
  • Levinson, J. (1997). “Emotion in Response to Art: A Survey of the Terrain”, in Hjort, M. & Laver, S. (eds.), Emotion and the Arts. New York: Oxford University press. 20-34
    • A short and useful survey of the various questions and positions about our emotional responses to artworks. Could be used as a supplement to the present article.
  • Lucas, F.L. (1928). Tragedy in Relation to Aristotle’s Poetics. Hogarth
    • Classic treatment of Aristotle’s view on tragedy. Defines catharsis as moral purification.
  • Lyons, W. (1980). Emotion. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
    • A classic exposition of the cognitive theory of emotion.
  • Mannison, D. (1985). “On Being Moved By Fiction”, Philosophy, 60, 71-87
    • Article on the paradox of fiction. Develops a solution appealing to surrogate objects.
  • Matravers, D. (1998). Art and Emotion. Oxford: Oxford University Press
    • A comprehensive study of the relationship between emotion and art.
  • Matravers, D. (2006). “The Challenge of Irrationalism, and How Not To Meet It”, in Kieran, M. (ed.), Contemporary Debates in Aesthetics and the Philosophy of Art. Blackwell. 254-264
    • An interesting discussion on the rationality and value of emotions in response to works of fiction.
  • Moran, R. (1994). “The Expression of Feeling in Imagination”, Philosophical Review, 103, 1, 75-106
    • Classic article on imagination and the emotions.
  • Morreall, J. (1985). “Enjoying Negative Emotions in Fiction”, Philosophy and Literature, 9, 95-103
    • A response to the paradox of tragedy appealing to control.
  • Neill, A. (1991). “Fear, Fiction and Make-Believe”, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 49, 1, 47-56
    • Provides a good discussion of the notion of make-believe.
  • Neill, A. (1992). “On a Paradox of the Heart”, Philosophical Studies, 65, 53-65
    • A critical discussion of Carroll’s solution to the paradox of horror.
  • Neill, A. (1993). “Fiction and the Emotions”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 30, 1-13
    • Proposes a solution to the paradox of fiction in terms of beliefs about what is fictionally the case.
  • Novitz, D. (1980). “Fiction, Imagination, and Emotion”, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 38, 279-288
    • Develops a version of the ‘thought’ theory in terms of imagination.
  • Nussbaum, M.C. (1992). Love’s Knowledge: Essays on Philosophy and Literature. Oxford: Oxford University Press
    • Classic text at the intersection of philosophy and literature. Provides a defense of the claim according to which literature can play a positive role in moral philosophy.
  • Paskins, B. (1977). “On Being Moved by Anna Karenina and Anna Karenina”, Philosophy, 52, 344-347
    • Article on the paradox of fiction. Provides a solution in terms of surrogate objects.
  • Radford, C. (1975). “How Can We Be Moved by the Fate of Anna Karenina?”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, supplementary vol. 49, 67-80
    • The classic article where Radford introduces the so-called ‘paradox of fiction’.
  • Radford, C. (1989). “Emotions and Music: A Reply to the Cognitivists”, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 47, 1, 69-76
    • Article on emotion and music. Responds to views assuming the cognitive theory of emotion (such as Kivy’s).
  • Ridley, A. (1995). Music, Value, and the Passions. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press
    • A thorough study of the relationship between music and emotion. Defense of the claim that the emotions we feel in response to music can positively contribute to a proper understanding of it.
  • Robinson, J. (2005). Deeper than Reason: Emotion and its Role in Literature, Music, and Art. New York: Oxford University Press
    • A comprehensive treatment of the relationship between emotions and artworks. A very good discussion on the nature of emotions included.
  • Smuts, A. (2007). “The Paradox of Painful Art”, Journal of Aesthetic Education, 41, 3, 59-77
    • Excellent discussion on the paradox of tragedy. Puts forward the rich experience theory.
  • Smuts, A. (2009). “Art and Negative Affect”, Philosophy Compass, 4, 1, 39-55
    • Excellent introduction to the paradox of tragedy. Good supplement to the present article.
  • Suits, D.B. (2006). “Really Believing in Fiction”, Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 87, 369-386
    • Article on the paradox of fiction. Argues that, while engaging with fictional stories, we do believe in their content.
  • Solomon, R. (1993). The Passions: Emotions and the Meaning of Life. Indianapolis: Hackett
    • Classic text in the philosophy of emotion. Develops a cognitive account of emotion.
  • Tappolet, C. (2000). Emotions et valeurs. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France
    • Classic defense of the perceptual theory of emotion (in French).
  • Todd, C. (forthcoming). “Attending Emotionally to Fiction”, Journal of Value Inquiry
    • Article on the paradox of fiction. Proposes a solution appealing to the notion of bracketed beliefs. A plausible version of the suspension of disbelief strategy.
  • Walton, K.L. (1978). “Fearing Fictions”, Journal of Philosophy, 75, 5-27
    • Classic paper on the paradox of fiction. Introduction of the notion of quasi-emotion.
  • Walton, K.L. (1990). Mimesis as Make-Believe. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press
    • Classic text on the nature of our engagement with fictions.
  • Walton, K.L. (1997). “Spelunking, Simulation, and Slime: On Being Moved by Fiction”, in Hjort, M. & Laver, S. (eds.), Emotion and the Arts. New York: Oxford University press. 37-49
    • Article on the paradox of fiction. Worth comparing with Walton’s earlier formulation of his views on the matter.
  • Weston, P (1975). “How Can We Be Moved by the Fate of Anna Karenina? II.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, supplementary vol. 49, 81-93
    • Article on the paradox of fiction. Provides a solution in terms of surrogate objects.
  • Yanal, R.J. (1994). “The Paradox of Emotion and Fiction”, Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 75, 54-75
    • A good article for an introduction to the paradox of fiction.
  • Zangwill, N. (2004). “Against Emotion: Hanslick Was Rightbout Music”, British Journal of Aesthetics, 44, 29-43
    • A thorough defense of the view that emotions are aesthetically inappropriate in an engagement with musical works.

Author Information

Hichem Naar
University of Manchester
United Kingdom

The Aesthetic Attitude

Aesthetics is the subject matter concerning, as a paradigm, fine art, but also the special, art-like status sometimes given to applied arts like architecture or industrial design or to objects in nature. It is hard to say precisely what is shared among this motley crew of objects (often referred to as aesthetic objects), but the aesthetic attitude is supposed to go some way toward solving this problem. It is, at the very least, the special point of view we take toward an object that results in our having an aesthetic experience (an experience of, for example, beauty, sublimity, or even ugliness). Many aesthetic theories, however, have taken it to play a central role in defining the boundary between aesthetic and non-aesthetic objects. These theories, usually called aesthetic attitude theories, argue that when we take the aesthetic attitude toward an object, we thereby make it an aesthetic object.

These theories originate in the notion of disinterest that was investigated by eighteenth-century aesthetic thinkers. While important to these thinkers, the idea of disinterest becomes even more crucial in the aesthetic theories of Kant and Schopenhauer. In these two philosophers, especially the latter, we begin to find aesthetic attitude theories. In the twentieth century, some major thinkers adopted the aesthetic attitude as a fundamental notion, but did not do so without facing serious criticism. Indeed, aesthetic attitude theories are not as popular as they once were, due to this criticism and to a more general shift of focus.

Table of Contents

  1. The Aesthetic Attitude
    1. Introductory Clarifications
    2. Disinterest
    3. Appreciation for Its Own Sake
  2. Historical Underpinnings
    1. Eighteenth-Century British Philosophers
    2. Kant
    3. Schopenhauer
  3. Twentieth-Century Aesthetic Attitude Theories
    1. Bullough and Psychical Distance
    2. Stolnitz
    3. Scruton
  4. Criticism
    1. Against Aesthetic Attitude Theories
    2. In Defense of Aesthetic Attitude Theories
    3. Where to Go From Here
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Aesthetic Attitude

There are two parts to the aesthetic attitude: the aesthetic part, and the attitude part. Here, an attitude is a certain state of mind. In particular, it is a way of approaching experiences or orienting oneself toward the world. It may help to think of someone with an optimistic attitude. He has a tendency to see things in a positive light. With the aesthetic attitude, the thought is not that there are certain people who generally see things, so to speak, in an aesthetic light, but more aligned with what is meant by the request that someone “have a more optimistic attitude” or “take a more positive attitude” about a given circumstance. We are asked, in such situations, to make ourselves attend in a certain way. In adopting an optimistic attitude, we focus on features of the situation that we can spin positively – we may realize the bad things are not really so bad and look instead for a silver lining. In adopting the aesthetic attitude, we focus on features of the situation that we think are relevant aesthetically – we may stop thinking about where we are parked and instead begin following the plot and the character development of the play being performed before us.

As these examples suggest, the aesthetic attitude is supposed to be a frame of mind that we can adopt more or less when we choose to. Of course, difficulties can arise for lots of reasons. A cell phone that rings during a symphony is reviled because it inevitably grabs our attention, and problems may arise adopting the aesthetic attitude, too, if we are distracted by hunger or unable to resist work-related worries. Thus, the analogy to optimism may be apt in a further way. It seems much easier for some people to adopt an optimistic attitude than it is for others, and many philosophers have thought that some people have a knack for taking the aesthetic attitude where others find it harder.

a. Introductory Clarifications

There are paradigm cases where we adopt the aesthetic attitude, for example, in a museum or as a spectator at the theater. It is, however, important to realize that the aesthetic attitude is not simply an attitude we take in museums, but one that we can take toward nature, too. Finding the colors of a sunset or the complexity of a nautilus beautiful means directing an aesthetic attitude toward the sunset or the nautilus and thinking about it aesthetically. Indeed, many have argued that we can take the aesthetic attitude toward anything at all, and in doing so, make it an aesthetic object. A street scene, though we would not describe it as art or nature, could thus be approached aesthetically. Since there are things that we can take the aesthetic attitude toward that are not art, the aesthetic attitude is not just an artistic attitude. It is much broader than that.

Not only can we take the aesthetic attitude toward things that are not art, but we can also take it toward things that are not beautiful. Some art is ugly, and certain artworks even flaunt their ugliness for artistic effect. In fact, calling something ugly is giving it an aesthetic evaluation, which in turn requires taking the aesthetic attitude toward it. So, in adopting the aesthetic attitude, say, toward a sunset, you start to look at the aesthetic features of the sunset. For example, you might pay attention to the visual composition of the landscape and view, or perhaps to the soft color gradations. Upon inspecting these elements, you might actually come to find them unsatisfactory. You might notice a traffic jam, a patch of large, barren trees, or a few unappealing vapor trails left by planes. You might reasonably conclude that it was, upon further inspection, kind of an ugly sunset. This conclusion could only be reached by looking at the scene aesthetically, that is, adopting the aesthetic attitude toward the scene. This makes it clear that we adopt the aesthetic attitude not only toward beautiful things, but also toward ugly things. Indeed, we must adopt the aesthetic attitude if any conclusion about a thing’s beauty or ugliness, in other words its aesthetic standing, is to be reached.

While these remarks make it clear that taking the aesthetic attitude toward something is not the same as finding it beautiful, it is a matter of debate whether the aesthetic attitude involves some kind of pleasure. We have seen that it does not necessarily involve straightforward aesthetic enjoyment or positive aesthetic evaluation, but it might still involve some broader kind of enjoyment, pleasure, or satisfaction. Whether it does and what kind exactly is something to be spelled out by the particular aesthetic attitude theory.

As mentioned above, many reserve the term ‘aesthetic attitude theory’ for a theory according to which aesthetic objects are properly distinguished from non-aesthetic objects by our ability to take the aesthetic attitude toward them. Not everyone agrees on this classification of aesthetic attitude theories, but there is sufficient consensus for us to assume it here. Given that, it may be helpful at the outset to point out that aesthetic attitude theories have experienced waning popularity in the past few decades. This may be due to criticism of the theory or to other theories that offer alternative accounts of the relevant distinction, both of which will be canvassed below.

Before continuing, a word of caution may be helpful. The term ‘aesthetic’ is applied to many things: we have already seen aesthetic attitude, aesthetic objects, and aesthetic experience, but philosophers also talk about aesthetic evaluations and aesthetic judgments (for example, judging that something is beautiful), aesthetic features (for example, symmetry), aesthetic contemplation, aesthetic emotions, and so on. Many of these will come up here, but the important thing to keep in mind is that this is just how philosophers refer to the special class of experiences, judgments, emotions, and so forth. that pertains to the art-like realm discussed above. Different theorists take different views of how these notions relate to each other and which is the most basic, but all take as an aim the discussion of the special sphere of the aesthetic.

b. Disinterest

There are two ways of thinking about the aesthetic attitude that have been most prevalent. First, it has been thought of as a special kind of disinterested attitude. The person who adopts the aesthetic attitude does not view (hear, taste, and so forth) objects with some kind of personal interest, that is, with a view to what that object can do for her, broadly speaking. A collector may view an expensive painting she owns and praise herself for owning such a rare and pricey piece. We might say that, in such a case, she takes an economic attitude toward the painting, but she without a doubt fails to think about it aesthetically. If she were instead viewing the painting contemplatively, thinking about its composition, meaning, and so on, then she would be thinking about it aesthetically, and that seems to be due to her disinterested attitude toward it. Similarly, a music student taking a music theory test might listen for certain particular keys or chord progressions, but he seems to listen to the music with the goal of getting a good grade on his test, rather than listen to the music simply to enjoy it, or for the experience of listening to it.

For many, disinterest is only a necessary condition of the aesthetic attitude, so that an attitude’s being disinterested does not guarantee that it is an aesthetic attitude. Something else may have to be present. A court judge will approach a trial with disinterest in this sense. He will try to be impartial and not let any personal feelings or goals cloud his judgment, but he does not thereby approach the trial aesthetically. Something else about his attitude would have to be present.

Furthermore, having this kind of disinterested attitude toward something by no means precludes finding it interesting. If the collector, in her more contemplative state, finds the interactions among a certain cluster of figures especially meaningful, then we can describe her as interested in those figures. This does not mean, however, that she is interested in them for some external purpose. Disinterestedness, then, does not indicate complete lack of interest (finding something uninteresting), but a lack of personal investment or goal-directed interest.

c. Appreciation for Its Own Sake

Suppose now that the music student above were instead listening to the music simply to enjoy it or just for the experience of listening to it. We might say that he was listening to the music for its own sake. This suggests the second traditional way of characterizing the aesthetic attitude. According to this way of thinking about it, the aesthetic attitude involves considering or appreciating something (for example an artwork) for its own sake. This means that we want to experience the work, not because it fulfills some desire for something else, but just because we want to have that experience. So a museum-goer may spend time in the Egyptian art galleries in order to make her son happy, but she may spend time in Islamic art galleries simply because she wants to look at and experience Islamic art, that is, she wants to see the objects for their own sake and not for the sake of anything beyond or outside of them. We will return to both of these traditional characterizations at greater length below.

Now that some idea of the nature of the aesthetic attitude is in place, we can turn to the development of the aesthetic attitude in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries. After that, we will be appropriately placed to look at the three main twentieth-century aesthetic attitude theories and some of the criticisms that have been made of them.

2. Historical Underpinnings

Aesthetic attitude theories are marked by their general insistence on the fundamental importance of the aesthetic attitude. Some of these theories hold that the nature of art is explained by the aesthetic attitude. This is generally accepted as an insufficient way of setting the boundaries of art, for reasons we have already seen, since nature, too, is a perfectly fine thing to take the aesthetic attitude toward. Most aesthetic attitude theories thus offer subtler and more complex accounts of the interaction among the aesthetic attitude, art, and beauty. Indeed, many of these philosophers have been keen on distinguishing a variety of different aesthetic qualities. In addition to beauty, they are interested in sublimity, novelty, charm, and so on.

There is no consensus regarding where exactly in the history of philosophy the aesthetic attitude first appears. The phrase ‘aesthetic attitude’ only appears in print very late in the nineteenth century, so some maintain that, before the twentieth century, there were no aesthetic attitude theories properly speaking. Even granting this, there is still clear historical precedent for the theory, and in spirit these historical theories bear a great deal of resemblance to the later aesthetic attitude theories.

Tracing the aesthetic attitude theory back to its origins, we may find its clearest early ancestor in the eighteenth-century notion of disinterest. This is to be found among a group of British thinkers writing about beauty and taste. Among these, Lord Shaftesbury is probably the earliest to discuss the notion in any real depth. The next important figure is Immanuel Kant, who wrote his three critiques at the end of the eighteenth century, the third of which, the Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790), is devoted to his theory of aesthetics and teleology. The final seminal figure is Arthur Schopenhauer, whose book The World as Will and Representation (1844) discusses aesthetic contemplation at length. It is in Schopenhauer that some notion of the aesthetic attitude is most noticeable and the similarities to modern theories most apparent. This section will provide an overview of the classical sources of aesthetic attitude theories, starting from their seeds in eighteenth-century British theories of taste, through Kant, and up to Schopenhauer.

a. Eighteenth-Century British Philosophers

The relationship between the aesthetic attitude and eighteenth-century British theories of taste is a subject of debate. Some philosophers, like Jerome Stolnitz, argue that there is a deep continuity, and that, really, these British philosophers have the same essential views as other classical aesthetic attitude theorists like Kant and Schopenhauer. Others, like George Dickie, have argued that there is an important divide between the two groups of theories. The details of the debate aside, it is hard to deny any connection. At the very least, these British philosophers influenced Kant and thus, either directly or indirectly, inspired everyone who has written about the aesthetic attitude since.

Several important British philosophers wrote about aesthetics and art. Shaftesbury, Francis Hutcheson, and David Hume, among yet others, wrote prominently about beauty and taste. Their theories are often referred to as theories of taste because they each essentially involve the notion of a special kind of faculty, the faculty of taste, that we use to determine an object’s aesthetic value. This faculty is generally taken to be naturally better in some than in others, though we can do things to improve it (expose ourselves to variety, learn about the artistic medium, and so on). Later British theorists, such as Edmund Burke, argued against such a faculty, worrying that it failed to really explain anything.

Most importantly, it is in these theories that we first find the notion of disinterest (though in Hume it appears as a lack of “prejudice”). Each of these philosophers argued that aesthetic appreciation involves disinterested pleasure. Despite slight differences among their notions of disinterest, the general idea is clear. When we are disinterested, we do not regard the aesthetic object as a tool for serving our own interests. One might wonder, however, whether it is independent from all other interests and all other values.

Shaftesbury argues that aesthetic experience is disinterested, but has a Platonic picture on which beauty is essentially the same as goodness and truth. Aesthetic appreciation is thus not devoid of any connection whatsoever to other values (ethical and epistemological), despite lacking connection to our personal ends and interests. For him, appreciating something aesthetically involves the same essential feeling as appreciating something morally. Shaftesbury does not, however, have a proper aesthetic attitude theory according to the above classification. His view is not one according to which our approaching something aesthetically makes it an aesthetic object. Beauty, along with morality and truth, are independent of our minds, though it is through taking the aesthetic attitude that we are able to recognize them. Shaftesbury may think that these things depend on the mind of God, but they certainly do not depend on us.

Hutcheson and Hume, on the other hand, disagree with Shaftesbury’s unified view. Both reject the equivalence of beauty, goodness, and truth, and see more of a gap between aesthetic value and other values. The details of Hutcheson and Hume differ, but both adopt Shaftesbury’s stress on disinterest. This is the crucial point on which all three theorists agree: they all share the central idea of disinterested pleasure as independent from personal interest, and it is this notion that forms the starting point for aesthetic attitude theories.

b. Kant

Kant is the next place to look for a theory of the aesthetic attitude. He takes up the notion of our judgments of beauty, but seems to follow earlier suspicions about a special faculty of taste. He opts instead to make his central notion that of aesthetic judgments, also called judgments of taste or judgments of the beautiful. His task is then to explain what exactly these are and how we make them. According to Kant, aesthetic judgments involve four important aspects. They must be disinterested, be universal, exhibit purposiveness without purpose, and be necessary. This article will focus mainly on disinterestedness, as it is there that we see most clearly the connection to the aesthetic attitude. A brief explanation of the other three will be included, as well, in order to present a clearer picture of the overall view. (See also the article on Kant’s Aesthetics.)

The first necessary condition regards the quality that our judgments of taste have. This is not quality in the sense of their being good or bad, accurate or inaccurate, or so on. Instead, by the quality of such judgments, Kant means their nature, what they are like and what they feel like. Kant points out, first, that all judgments of taste are essentially subjective. They come from our feelings, not from any objective fact that exists out in the world. He then argues that there are three kinds of satisfaction: that which we take in the agreeable, the beautiful, and the good, and he uses the contrasts to better clarify the nature of judgments of taste.

First, the agreeable gratifies some desire. We find tea agreeable when we have a desire for tea. In this sense, the pleasure in the tea is interested, since it serves our purpose. Kant also points out that our finding it agreeable depends essentially on us and our psychology. This also means, though, that it is not up to us to choose what to find agreeable. Our psychologies determine what we find agreeable, and we cannot change what we desire simply by willing to. One cannot stop a craving, for example, just by choosing to stop, since cravings do not work that way.

Next, we come to the good. The good is esteemed and approved, and there is objective value set on it. We find being generous good when we set objective value on generosity or generous actions. Pleasure in the good is also interested, since, for Kant, reason determines what we find good. This is still a personal interest because each person has an interest in bringing about the good. The person who finds generosity good has an interest in bringing about a more generous world, for example, by being generous and encouraging other people to do so.

The beautiful, in contrast, is disinterested pleasure. The art collector who enjoys her artwork for its monetary value enjoys that work in an interested way, and thus has not taken the aesthetic attitude toward it. Consequently, any positive judgment she produces will not be a judgment of taste. Kant takes this idea further, arguing that anyone who really approaches something with a contemplative, disinterested attitude and finds it beautiful (that is, takes the aesthetic attitude toward it) will not even be interested in whether the object in fact exists. To want the object to exist is to have an interest wrapped up in it, or in other words, to have something be at stake in its existence. Kant illustrates his point with a helpful example. Imagine a conversation in which one person asks another whether he finds a certain palace beautiful. He answers by saying that he dislikes things made on the backs and at the expense of the proletariat, or that he would never want such a thing for himself. These are cases where the palace’s existence is offensive or undesirable. The man has simply not answered the question of its beauty. The man has not taken an aesthetic attitude toward it. This is what Kant means when he says that the object’s existence cannot factor into the judgment. The aesthetic attitude is related to these remarks in that we must have a certain frame of mind, that is, a disinterested one, in order to make aesthetic judgments.

There are three other conditions of judgments of taste. They must be universal, which just means that they feel as though they apply to everyone. Calling something beautiful means feeling like everyone should recognize it as beautiful (even if we realize that it is not a fact about the object that it is beautiful). The objects of these judgments also exhibit what Kant calls purposiveness without purpose, or alternatively, finality without an end (a translation offered by Creed Meredith). This may sound complex, but it just means that, while there may be no actual purpose of the object (or at least, not one of which we are aware), we are struck by how it seems to be made for a purpose. For example, though we may not know why a plant’s leaves are arranged in angles echoing the Fibonacci sequence, we notice a certain pattern and appreciate the purposiveness there. If, though, the actual purpose entered our judgment, then we would have the beginnings of interested pleasure, which Kant has argued cannot be aesthetic. Finally, these judgments are also necessary in the sense that it feels like we judge according to some unspoken universal rule, from which our judgment necessarily follows.

Above, we saw that Kant takes aesthetic judgments to be subjective. However, the bigger picture reveals a more nuanced view. Such judgments come from our feelings of pleasure, but only when we take that pleasure to be universal, necessary, and felt in response to purposiveness rather than purpose. The universality, necessity, and reaction to the appearance of purpose (and not to actual purpose) exist only because our pleasure is disinterested. It is precisely when we experience this kind of subjective yet disinterested pleasure that we think these judgments hold universally and necessarily. Thus disinterest, a notion first brought to the fore by the eighteenth-century British philosophers, continues to be a central notion in Kant’s aesthetics. However, Kant does not seem to have a true aesthetic attitude theory in the sense defined above. It is a matter of interpretation, but it looks as though he does not think that any object we approach with this frame of mind thereby becomes an aesthetic object. Many argue that it is not until Schopenhauer, for whom disinterest is even more important, that we see an actual aesthetic attitude theory.

c. Schopenhauer

The notion of the aesthetic attitude may not appear fully formed until Schopenhauer, in Book III of The World as Will and Representation. Schopenhauer does not use the term ‘aesthetic attitude’, either, but instead talks about aesthetic contemplation. His understanding of this form of contemplation, however, is clearly related to twentieth-century aesthetic attitude theories, and as such he is generally looked to as the historical philosopher whose view is closest to the contemporary versions of the theory

To understand his view of the aesthetic attitude, it helps to know a little bit about Schopenhauer’s philosophy. He understands life as driven by the Will, which is a kind of unceasing desire and forms the basis of perpetual human suffering. When we desire something, we suffer in not having it. If we were to obtain all the things we desired, we would be overcome with boredom, a deeper and more poignant suffering. Experiencing the world in this way is experiencing the world as Will. However, he sees a few ways out of this. The most permanent solution is to adopt a severe ascetic outlook and stop having desires at all, but a temporary solution is to be found in aesthetic contemplation, where we experience the world as representation rather than as Will.

In a famous passage (section 34), Schopenhauer describes a few things that go along with the aesthetic attitude (although, again, he does not use this term). We may then begin to see how this contemplative state can release us from the cycle of suffering. First, we do not look at things in the ordinary way. This is generally accepted as having both a perceptual meaning and a non-perceptual one. There is a special aesthetic mode of perception where we attend much more fully to the surface features of an object. However, we also typically look at something with an eye to its relationships to other things. Schopenhauer argues that this boils down to looking at it with an eye to how it might help our own goals, that is, relate to our wills. In the aesthetic attitude, though, this relational viewing is completely absent, and we only pay attention to things themselves. Second, we do not have in mind abstract thought or reasoning, but instead focus on the perception alone. Here Schopenhauer says that the representation fills our mind and we are thus filled with calm contemplation. In this way, we stop thinking about the will and, since the perception takes up all of our mental ‘space’, we no longer sense a difference between ourselves and the object perceived. This means that, third, we will begin to see, in a sense, through the object itself to its Idea. So far, what this means is a bit opaque, but we can understand it in the following way. When we stop looking at the particular thing and what it might do for our own ends, we stop experiencing the world as related to our wills. Instead, we experience the world as representation. But these representations must be of something, and indeed they are representations of Ideas. These are similar to Plato’s Ideas or Forms: they are eternal and unchangeable. So when we contemplate things aesthetically, that is, take the aesthetic attitude toward things, we can know the Ideas. (It is, moreover, the aim of the aesthetic attitude to know the Ideas.)

Since everything represents Ideas and manifests the will in some way, anything can become the object of the aesthetic attitude. Not only does this mean that, according to our definition, Schopenhauer has an aesthetic attitude theory, but it also means that the aesthetic attitude has profound practical import. It can release us from the cycle of constant suffering, since we stop experiencing our wills in any way. Aesthetic contemplation also helps us deal with very real, very difficult situations. If we start to think aesthetically about the world, other people, and ourselves, then we will stop being angry, resentful, or sad (though we will also stop being excited or happy). We will instead see things that cause us pain as manifestations of the Idea of humanity, as nothing new or special. To put it a slightly different way, we will stop taking things personally. The vicissitudes of life will become just that, simply fluctuations through which we can have real encounters with Ideas.

It would be misleading to suggest that taking the aesthetic attitude is easy and comes naturally to everyone. It is even slightly misleading to call it aesthetic contemplation. Contemplation suggests passivity, but Schopenhauer argues that artistic geniuses can not only actively adopt the aesthetic attitude, but can also remain in that state for longer than the typical fleeting moment. They find beauty in all kinds of places and use art to communicate their insights to the rest of us. These views have inspired a debate about whether the aesthetic attitude (and aesthetic experience) is active or passive: whether we can make ourselves adopt this outlook and have aesthetic experiences, or whether they simply happen to us when the stars align just right. Schopenhauer answers that the aesthetic attitude is some mix of these, that certain people are more adept at engaging it actively, while it is a transient and happenstance state for others.

In Schopenhauer, we thus see a clear extension of the earlier notion of disinterest. In aesthetic contemplation, we stop thinking about the world and the objects in it as means to our ends, that is, as objects of our will. We also see attention and perception take center stage. Aesthetic contemplation, which can be active or passive, involves intense focus where the perception completely fills the mind. Finally, we see a crucial role for the aesthetic attitude in the larger theory. It helps us know Ideas, and by doing so, releases us from endless suffering. Many aspects of Schopenhauer’s view have resonated with subsequent philosophers of aesthetics. But in order to fully adopt his view, one must adopt much of the rest of his philosophy, that is, his theory of Ideas, representation, and the Will. Later aesthetic attitude theorists are generally unwilling to do this, but they still manage to preserve some key aspects of the view.

3. Twentieth-Century Aesthetic Attitude Theories

There are three prominent aesthetic attitude theorists in the twentieth century: Edward Bullough, Jerome Stolnitz, and Roger Scruton. Each of these three theorists tries to accomplish at least two major goals. First, each tries to give an intuitive definition of what the aesthetic attitude is, one that does not make the wrong attitudes (for example, interested ones) aesthetic attitudes but includes all the attitudes that do seem to be aesthetic. The second aim of each theory is to say something about the relationship between the aesthetic attitude and the philosophy of art and aesthetics more generally. In particular, they all use the aesthetic attitude to provide a definition of aesthetic objects, that is, to demarcate aesthetic objects from non-aesthetic ones.

a. Bullough and Psychical Distance

Bullough, a psychologist, is the first theorist here to use the term ‘aesthetic attitude’, but actually most often uses the interchangeable term ‘aesthetic consciousness’. His theory essentially involves disinterest, which he talks about as psychical distance. It is worth noting at the outset that his theory has not gained widespread support, though it has significantly contributed to the shaping of subsequent theories of the aesthetic attitude. We will see that his way of approaching and developing the notion of disinterest, though perhaps flawed, provides an interesting and evocative metaphor for aesthetic experience.

Bullough calls the central feature of aesthetic consciousness psychical distance, a metaphorical extension of spatial and temporal distance. We are all familiar with what it is to be distanced from something in space; it is just to be far away. Similarly, to be temporally distant from something is to exist, say, a hundred years after it. Bullough characterizes the experience of psychical distance as that of not being very emotionally close to or attached to something and not thinking about its practical role. His example is of a fog. Normally, a fog at sea causes us anxiety because it drastically reduces our field of vision, is associated with unexpected dangers, and is difficult to navigate. If, however, we take the aesthetic attitude toward it, we can direct our attention to its surface features. The fog may look soft and even palpable, and the air may feel peaceful and still. These latter sensations occur because we have been able to insert the proper psychical distance between ourselves and the fog.

This distance, Bullough says, is the result of putting the perceived object “out of gear” with our practical interests. Our practical ends should have no traction on our thoughts when we are properly distanced. We should not think about practical or personal concerns, but instead focus on the object itself. We also need, therefore, to be properly distanced from certain emotions, like those that concern our personal stake or even those that concern morality. That said, emotional response is still intimately involved in aesthetic consciousness and experience, but these emotions need to be generalized beyond our individual, particular feelings. So far, this sounds similar to the notion of disinterest discussed above. Bullough adds to this by explaining two ways distancing can go wrong.

We can fail to be properly distanced from a work if we are too psychically close to it or too psychically far away – that is, if we are too emotionally involved or too emotionally removed. Bullough refers to these conditions respectively as under-distancing and over-distancing. Under-distancing occurs when we are unable to separate our personal interests from what we experience. Suppose a jealous husband watches a performance of Othello and becomes increasingly suspicious, his rage building, and eventually only really sees himself and his wife instead of Othello and Desdemona. This man is under-distanced, since his emotions are too involved in the play’s action. On the other hand, imagine a brilliant satire of ancient Chinese society that we are now in very poor position to appreciate. This is a case of over-distancing. For many such works, the artwork may be sadly unable to engage our emotions sufficiently because we are too removed from it. Thus there is what Bullough terms a distance-limit, beyond which we are too far away to have aesthetic consciousness. He says that, practically speaking, people should err on the side of trying to distance themselves, since our tendency is to get too emotionally involved. What we should aim for, in theory, is the greatest distance without passing the distance-limit.

Here, we can see that spatial and temporal distance are not merely metaphors for psychical distance. We are too temporally removed to properly engage with the brilliant Chinese satire. Similarly, Bullough argues, being too spatially close to a work can make us unable to engage with it properly. This is in fact how he explains the relegation of culinary art to a second class art form. Since we have to taste these things and thus come into direct physical contact with them, we are simply unable to distance ourselves sufficiently from them.

Bullough also uses his theory to interesting effect in explaining why artists are sometimes censored, ostracized, or banned. Artists are better able to distance themselves than the average person, so they see more objects aesthetically. Non-artists, however, may look at the art and see only a hypersexualized youth (Nabokov’s Lolita), say, or a sacrilegious depiction of a holy figure (Serrano’s “Piss Christ”)

Many have found these implications implausible. Physical closeness to a work, for example, does not actually seem to preclude the proper psychical distance or disinterested attitude. There are further worries that, at best, Bullough only offers a necessary condition for the aesthetic attitude. Without something further, he ca not distinguish it from the court judge’s disinterested attitude. That said, Bullough is still an important figure in the development of aesthetic attitude theory. His development of a structured and explanatorily ambitious view set the tone for the aesthetic attitude theories that follow.

b. Stolnitz

For Stolnitz, the aesthetic attitude involves attending to something (anything) in a disinterested and sympathetic way, and doing so for its own sake. When we look at something in a disinterested way, we look at it non-instrumentally. This is just to say that we do not look at it as a means (as an instrument) to some other end. So, as above, the collector who admires her painting for its rarity fails to engage with her painting aesthetically. Similarly, the music student who looks for musical knowledge in the keys and chords of the symphony does not engage with it aesthetically. Interestingly, Stolnitz mentions that this also implies that the attitude of an art critic, either amateur or professional, is opposed to the aesthetic attitude. To see why this is so, it is enough to recognize that the critic has a goal: to form and pass judgment.

By including sympathy as a criterion of the aesthetic attitude, Stolnitz introduces the idea that the right attitude must take the artwork on its own terms. One needs to ignore personal conflicts and biases. The discovery that an artist was a miser should not change one’s aesthetic attitude toward the work, though it may give one pause when thinking morally about the artist. To up the ante, he argues that in order to view propaganda art or Nazi art with the proper aesthetic viewpoint, one will have to view it sympathetically, as well, and ignore the moral backdrop against which these things exist. (Nobody said that taking the aesthetic attitude was easy.) Failure to do so will taint any aesthetic experience that results, something we may be able to see in our occasional complaints to others that they “haven’t even given it a chance.” (To be clear, Stolnitz does not make and is not committed to any claims about the moral import of taking the aesthetic attitude in these difficult situations.)

Stolnitz understands attention, the third major component of his definition, as a kind of alert state. He agrees with predecessors that it is a kind of contemplation, but says that we have to understand contemplation in the right way. He agrees with Schopenhauer that the aesthetic attitude is not as passive as the term ‘contemplation’ suggests. (He disagrees, however, with Schopenhauer’s claim that only artistic geniuses can actively engage in aesthetic contemplation.) Aesthetic contemplation does not involve simply sitting back, relaxing, and letting the mind wander. It involves mental focus and thought, and such intense mental involvement may manifest itself in a tightening of muscles during a thrilling scene, a foot tapping to the beat, or a tilt of one’s head like the figure in a painting. Such physical manifestations are not required by the aesthetic attitude, but they exemplify the active, engaged mental state that itself does constitute the proper attitude.

Stolnitz is a proper aesthetic attitude theorist who argues that we can adopt the aesthetic attitude toward anything. He acknowledges that this implies that nothing is inherently unaesthetic. Stolnitz offers intuitive support for this view, pointing out that artists often approach ugly or boring objects with the aesthetic attitude and create something beautiful. A deformed and hideous bell pepper may, when approached in the right way, become a striking aesthetic object, as in the photographs of Edward Weston. Similarly, a humble shipping container or typeface may, when one takes the proper aesthetic attitude toward it, appear noble, subtle, and beautiful. So we can find traditionally ugly things aesthetic, but we can also find boring, everyday objects aesthetic when we approach them in the right way. It follows, moreover, from this view that neither art nor nature is inherently more aesthetic than the other. Since nothing is inherently unaesthetic, nothing in art is at an aesthetic disadvantage to anything in nature, and vice versa.

He also uses the aesthetic attitude to demarcate the bounds between things that count as aesthetically relevant and irrelevant, that is, what is and is not relevant to the aesthetic experience and to any verdict that may result from it. Thoughts that are compatible with disinterested, sympathetic attention can be aesthetically relevant as long as they do not divert attention away from the aesthetic object. Certain kinds of interpretation can thus count as aesthetically relevant or be ruled out as irrelevant. A poem might perfectly well suggest a cathedral without saying it explicitly. The thought of a cathedral that accompanies the poem is thus aesthetically relevant. However, it might also remind one of a personal experience, say, of one’s wedding that took place in a cathedral. This diverts attention away from the poem and is thus, argues Stolnitz, aesthetically irrelevant.

Stolnitz also applies these ideas to the problem of determining the aesthetic relevance of external facts. Such facts are aesthetically relevant when they (1) do not weaken our aesthetic attention, (2) pertain to the meaning or expressiveness of the object, and (3) enhance the quality of one’s aesthetic response. For example, it may be relevant to know that a certain painting is of the crucifixion of Jesus. It may, however, be irrelevant that Gauguin’s rendering of the Crucifixion does not accurately capture the story as it is told in the gospels. Perhaps the point is, so to speak, precisely to paint it in a different light.

Of all the theorists surveyed here, Stolnitz falls most squarely into our model of an aesthetic attitude theorist. His notion of the aesthetic attitude is completely explicit and forms the core of his theory. He uses it to define aesthetic objects and explain the aesthetic relevance of external thoughts and facts, as well as a host of related aesthetic issues.

c. Scruton

For Scruton, the aesthetic attitude has three main components. First, its goal is some kind of pleasure, enjoyment, or satisfaction. This means that, although the aesthetic attitude may not always in fact yield pleasure, it is our hope in taking such an attitude that it will. If we thought there were no enjoyment of any kind we could get out of an object, we would not attend to it aesthetically. The view should not be mistaken for what we might call aesthetic hedonism, the view that aesthetic value resides solely in a thing’s ability to give us pleasure. Pleasure should not be thought of too narrowly, either. Sad music can afford aesthetic satisfaction, as can paintings of violent scenes.

The aesthetic attitude must also involve attention to an object for its own sake. Scruton expresses dissatisfaction about how little the notion of ‘for its own sake’ has been explained by other theorists. To see this, consider that we know perfectly well what it means to do something for our own sake or for someone else’s sake. It is to do something with their interests in mind. What would attending to art for the sake of the art’s interests be, though? Scruton finds the particular phrase strange, but tries to find the kernel of insight in it. To be interested in something for its own sake involves a desire to go on experiencing it, but not in order to satisfy another, separate desire. This means that, if the art collector has a desire to look at her painting, and part of her desire to look at it is that she desires to admire its rarity, then she has not taken the aesthetic attitude. She is interested in it for its own sake only when there are no other desires she has that seeing the painting would satisfy.

Third and finally, the aesthetic attitude is normative. Normative just means that there is a certain kind of ‘should’-ness about it or that it explicitly or implicitly contains a value judgment. If a mother tells her son to be respectful, she makes a normative claim on him: that it is good to be respectful, and that he should do it. Furthermore, if she just notices that he is being disrespectful and disapproves, there is something normative involved in her disapproving reaction. The aesthetic attitude is normative in the sense that any judgment that comes out of the aesthetic attitude carries normative force. In other words, when we think that something is beautiful, we think that other people should find it beautiful, too. This is how Scruton, a self-proclaimed Kantian, sees himself as taking on Kant’s view above that aesthetic judgments are universal.

It is worth remarking that Scruton may not be talking about the aesthetic attitude as we have seen it so far. Until now, the aesthetic attitude has been understood as a state of mind or a kind of viewpoint that one can generally adopt at will, and that must exist prior to any aesthetic experience. Scruton writes, however, that the aesthetic attitudes are what we express when we make aesthetic judgments. This would mean that, in calling something beautiful, we make an aesthetic judgment and thus express an aesthetic attitude, namely, the aesthetic attitude we had when we judged or experienced the object as beautiful. While not a problem with his view, this means that he may not be talking about exactly the same thing as the earlier theorists. Among other things, this view leads to there being many different aesthetic attitudes, rather than just one special frame of mind or mode of perception that we are in when we have particular aesthetic experiences. Scruton’s definition may actually come closer to the normal meaning of ‘attitude’, in the way that we talk about an attitude of disapproval or an attitude of hope. Here, we find attitudes of beauty, elegance, loveliness, their opposites, and so on.

4. Criticism

In 1964, George Dickie offered a set of famous objections to aesthetic attitude theories. After Dickie, the aesthetic attitude has received very little attention outside Scruton, which may suggest a general acceptance of his objections. A few defenses of aesthetic attitude theories have been offered, but the literature has not stirred much since, indicating perhaps instead simply a waning interest in the topic.

a. Against Aesthetic Attitude Theories

In his well-known paper, “The Myth of the Aesthetic Attitude,” Dickie objects in turn to each of Bullough and Stolnitz’s theories. Dickie argues that the former thinks of distancing as a special kind of action that we can perform: we put ourselves “out of gear” with practical concerns. We can aim to and can successfully distance ourselves from perceived objects. These make distancing sound very much like an action. Dickie swiftly dismisses this view on the grounds that there really is no such special action. What really happens in such cases is that we attend differently, and attending is a perfectly normal and unmysterious action. One might worry about the details of Dickie’s argument here, but since Stolnitz’s view is the more nuanced and fully developed of the two, the majority of criticism is focused on his view.

Recall that, for Stolnitz, the aesthetic attitude involves a special kind of aesthetic perception: disinterested, sympathetic attention. Dickie focuses on the ‘disinterested’ part of this definition, noting first that ‘disinterested’ is an unhelpful clarification unless it means something to be ‘interested’. Stolnitz, so far, should be fine with this, and we may recall that he gives many cases of interested attention to clarify what disinterest amounts to.

In essence Dickie argues that there are really no cases of interested attention. Any alleged case of interested attention in fact falls into one of two categories: either it is not attention to the artwork at all; or it is, but it really is not a different kind of attention from disinterested attention. On the one hand, there are examples like the jealous husband watching Othello or the art collector who is happy about her investment. Dickie argues that these are really cases where the perceiver is not actually paying attention to the artwork. In the former case, the jealous husband is paying attention to the situation with his wife rather than the play. In the latter case, the art collector is paying attention to her finances, rather than the painting.

On the other hand, there are cases like the music student paying attention to chord progressions or a father watching his daughter at a piano recital. In these situations, Dickie argues, the music student and the father are paying attention to the artwork. There is no difference in their manner of attending or perceiving, despite perhaps a difference in motive. To sharpen this, the idea is that there is no special mode of perception that corresponds uniquely to the way we perceive when we adopt the aesthetic attitude. There is only one way to perceive or attend to something, and that is just by looking at it or noting features of it. The father, the music student, and the ideal aesthetic perceiver are all doing just that. The father and music student may be differently motivated, but this means nothing for the way in which they actually perceive or attend to the work.

The key to Dickie’s argument is that he takes Bullough and Stolnitz to understand the aesthetic attitude as involving a special kind of action or attention. From this, he argues that there is no special mode or manner of acting or attending that uniquely produces aesthetic experiences.

b. In Defense of Aesthetic Attitude Theories

As mentioned earlier, some responses to this have been offered. Gary Kemp offered an extended response to Dickie’s objections. Foremost among these is the denial of Dickie’s crucial premise that there is only really one way of acting or attending. Kemp argues that there are many different ways of attending. The music student may attend to the chord progressions, to the orchestration, or to the rhythms. Here, the student seems to be attending fully, but also in an interested way. But if he attends for the sake of enjoyment, then he is certainly attending differently and perhaps disinterestedly. These, Kemp says, are genuinely different ways of attending, and the real difficulty of the aesthetic attitude theory is to explain why some of them seem aesthetic and some do not. He then offers his own explanation of this distinction.

Kemp argues that disinterested attention does not seem to select the right cases. For example, it is intuitive that the father who attends his daughter’s recital could attend perfectly aesthetically to her performance, despite the fact that the reason he is there is to see his daughter. Kemp instead prefers Scruton’s notion of interest in the experience for its own sake. This supports examples like the father. Once he starts listening, he has a desire to go on listening to the music, we can imagine, and this desire does not now depend on any other desire to sustain it (although it came to exist only because he wanted to hear his daughter play). There is now no reason for his desire aside from his wanting to keep listening to the music.

c. Where to Go From Here

Aesthetic attitude theories have enjoyed isolated appearances in the past forty years, but the interest in it may be declining. Again, this may be due in part to the belief that Dickie’s criticisms were devastating and final, but it may also be due to the general dissatisfaction with the theoretical role the aesthetic attitude has been made to play. Many have moved to views of aesthetic experience, rather than aesthetic attitude, as the crucial notion to be considered. The differences between the two are subtle, but definite. Recall that the aesthetic attitude is a point of view one takes. It is, in a sense, a way of priming our experience in which we mentally set ourselves up to pay attention to certain things. The experiences that result, if we have been successful, are aesthetic experiences. These aesthetic experiences, in certain contemporary views, play the theoretical role that the aesthetic attitude was originally meant to play. Thus, philosophers have recently tried to draw the boundary between aesthetic and non-aesthetic objects using the notion of an aesthetic experience instead of the aesthetic attitude. The things that afford aesthetic experiences (or, alternatively, facilitate it) are aesthetic objects. These views can extend their theoretical reaches further in many ways. For example, they can offer a definition of artworks as the things that are created intentionally in order to afford aesthetic experiences. As such, these theories may have largely supplanted the original aesthetic attitude theories, since aesthetic experience can seem like a less presumptuous notion and more theoretically powerful. This move to aesthetic experience is most prominent in the work of Monroe Beardsley, but also to be found in Malcolm Budd, Kendall Walton, and many other contemporary thinkers. Whatever the fate of the aesthetic attitude theories and the aesthetic experience theories that follow them, the notion of a special kind of aesthetic attitude or experience remains, if not of central theoretical importance, of great interest in thinking about our aesthetic lives.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Beardsley, Monroe. 1982. The Aesthetic Point of View. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
    • A collection of Beardsley’s essays. For the turn to aesthetic experience, see especially the essay “The Aesthetic Point of View.”
  • Budd, Malcolm. 1995. Values of Art. London: Penguin Books.
    • Budd’s main work in aesthetics that addresses aesthetic value across different media.
  • Bullough, Edward. 1957. Aesthetics: Lectures and Essays, ed. Elizabeth M. Wilkinson. London: Bowes & Bowes.
    • A collection of Bullough’s essays that includes both “‘Psychical Distance’” and “The Modern Conception of Aesthetics.”
  • Bullough, Edward. 1912. “‘Psychical Distance’ as a Factor in Art and an Aesthetic Principle.” British Journal of Psychology 5, 87-118.
    • The classic article in which the notion of psychical distance first appears.
  • Burke, Edmund. 1958. A Philosophical Enquiry into the Origin of our Ideas of the Sublime and the Beautiful, ed. James T. Boulton. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • Where Burke criticizes the faculty of taste and presents his own views of the beautiful and sublime.
  • Dickie, George. 1964. “The Myth of the Aesthetic Attitude.” American Philosophical Quarterly 1, 56-65.
    • The most famous objections to the aesthetic attitude theory.
  • Fenner, David. 1996. The Aesthetic Attitude. New Jersey: Humanities Press.
    • A thorough, historical overview of the issues. A great secondary resource.
  • Guyer, Paul. 1993. Kant and the Experience of Freedom: Essays on Aesthetics and Morality. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • A collection of essays about Kant’s aesthetics and the historical context surrounding it.
  • Hume, David. 1987. “Of the Standard of Taste.” In Eugene Miller (ed.), Essays: Moral, Political, and Literary (pp. 226-249). Indianapolis: Liberty Fund.
    • Hume explains how the faculty of taste develops and works.
  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1971. An Inquiry into the Original of Our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue. New York: Garland.
    • Hutcheson’s theory of the moral and aesthetic faculties.
  • Kant, Immanuel. 2000. Critique of the Power of Judgment, ed. Paul Guyer, trans. Paul Guyer and Eric Matthews. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Kant’s systematic treatment of aesthetics and teleology.
  • Kemp, Gary. 1999. “The Aesthetic Attitude.” British Journal of Aesthetics 39, 392-399.
    • A series of responses to Dickie’s objections, and a further analysis of aesthetic attitude theory.
  • Langfeld, Herbert Sidney. 1920. The Aesthetic Attitude. New York: Harcourt, Brace and Co.
    • An introduction to prominent theories of the time, mixed with Langfeld’s own views on the issues.
  • Schopenhauer, Arthur. 1969. The World as Will and Representation, Volume I, trans. Eric F. J. Payne. New York: Dover.
    • Schopenhauer’s magnum opus, in which he offers his theory of the world as developing Will and represented Ideas.
  • Scruton, Roger. 1982. Art and Imagination: A Study in the Philosophy of Mind. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • A theory of aesthetics developed on the basis of an empiricist philosophy of mind.
  • Shaftesbury, Anthony Ashley Cooper, Third Earl of. 1999. Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times, ed. Lawrence E. Klein. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Shaftesbury’s views on a wide range of topics. For his aesthetic theory, see especially the section “The Moralists.”
  • Stolnitz, Jerome. 1960. Aesthetics and Philosophy of Art Criticism. Cambridge: Riverside Press.
    • A topic-based introduction to aesthetics, mixed with Stolnitz’s own views on the issues.


Author Information

Alexandra King
Brown University
U. S. A.

Philosophy of Film: Continental Perspectives

This article introduces the most important perspectives on film (movies) from the continental philosophical perspective. “Continental” is not used as a geographical term, but as an abstract concept referring to nineteenth and twentieth century European philosophical traditions exemplified by German idealism, phenomenology, existentialism, hermeneutics, structuralism, post-structuralism, French feminism, and the Frankfurt School. The continental-friendly philosophy of film that has emerged in Anglophone countries since the 1980s also is taken into account in this article.

If one considers only contributions by well known philosophers, the philosophical output on film might appear relatively meager. Books that deal with the philosophy of film are equally rare. If, however, one considers the scholarly contributions from the entire field of humanities, specifically in the form of film aesthetics and film theory, the body of reflections on film inspired by philosophical ideas (in the most general sense) is impressive. Most of these works are linked to the European philosophical tradition of philosophy of film, which developed from the 1920s onward. Henri Bergson (1859-1941) was the first philosopher to show interest in film, though his influence on continental philosophy of film remained minor – though not inexistent – before the publication of Gilles Deleuze’s two volumes on cinema (1983 and 1985). In the 1980s, two French philosophers, Jean-Louis Schefer and Gilles Deleuze, decided to devote their attention to film studies. These studies began a continuous line of European philosophical works on film that stretched through to today’s writings by Jacques Rancière and Slavoj Žižek. In the English-speaking world, philosophical concepts entered the discourse on film at around the same time. Stanley Cavell’s work The World Viewed: Reflections on the Ontology of Film (1971) was a notable precursor of this tendency. In 1988, Noel Carroll published a critique of contemporary film theory (Mystifying Movies) which he criticized as being overly determined by Psycho-Semiotic Marxist paradigms. In the same year he published Philosophical Problems of Classical Film Theory that examined pre-semiotic theorists like Bazin and Arnheim in an analytical fashion.

Both representatives of the analytical and the continental tradition see thinkers that were active before the analytical-continental divide (for example, Münsterberg, Kracauer) as being central to their film studies; however, the interpretations of such thinkers differ considerably in both traditions.

A significant amount of continental work developed around the British journal Screen, which was very influential in the 1970s and has laid many of the foundations of Lacanian and neo-Marxist film theory.

Analytical philosophy of film has profited greatly from its rich tradition of analytical aesthetics. A significant part of this philosophy has attempted to push its studies in the direction of evidence-based scientific models. Continental thought has typically been inspired by the softer fields of humanities and has displayed a solid amount of political engagement. In the former Soviet Union, a complex discourse on the semiotics of film, inspired by a Russian formalist heritage that has a natural affinity with film, has made numerous philosophical statements.

Table of Contents

  1. What Is Philosophy Of Film?
    1. Continental vs. Analytical
    2. French Philosophy of Film
    3. Philosophy of Film in Other European Countries
  2. An Overview Of Theories
    1. Henri Bergson
    2. Hugo Münsterberg
    3. Formalist Approaches
      1. The Russian Formalism Tradition
        1. Sergei Eisenstein
        2. Vsevolod Pudovkin
        3. Lev Kuleshov
        4. Yuri Lotman
      2. Béla Balász: Film as Language
      3. Mikhail Bakhtin: Dialogicity and Reception
      4. Rationalism: Galvano Della Volpe
      5. Semiotics/Semiology
        1. Gilbert Cohen-Séat
        2. Roland Barthes
        3. Christian Metz
        4. Pier Paolo Pasolini
    4. Cinematographic Ontology and Phenomenology
      1. Phenomenology
        1. Maurice Merleau-Ponty
        2. Amédée Ayfre
      2. Realism:
        1. André Bazin
        2. Siegfried Kracauer
        3. Dziga Vertov
      3. Existentialism
        1. Alexandre Astruc’s Caméra-Stylo
      4. Film as Thought
        1. Jean Epstein: Film as Artificial Intelligence
        2. Jean Mitry
        3. Gilles Deleuze
        4. Filmosophy
      5. Film as Poetic Art: Susanne Langer
    5. Psychology/Psychoanalysis
      1. Rudolf Arnheim
        1. Psychoanalysis vs. Cognitive Science
      2. The Mindscreen Theory
      3. Slavoj Žižek
    6. Walter Benjamin and the Frankfurt School
    7. Hermeneutic Film Analysis
    8. Future Perspectives
  3. References and Further Reading

1. What Is Philosophy Of Film?

Many studies of film do not necessarily claim a specific philosophical heritage, but can be considered as philosophical inasmuch as their approaches are methodologically sophisticated and transgress empiricism. Though it is very difficult to establish positive standards for what is ‘’philosophical’’ and what is not, it can be concurred that an approach is “philosophical” as soon as it uses references to philosophers and some abstract concepts that are not merely technical. A degree of argumentation and claim-making supported by reasons, some sort of evidence, and analysis or interpretation, on the other hand, are not particular to philosophy but are followed by all (human) sciences.

Film Theory

Para-philosophical studies have also been conveniently labelled as ‘film theory’. Strictly speaking, film theory, which develops concepts like ‘narrativity’, ‘diegesis’, ‘genre’ or ‘authorship’ is not a unique philosophy, but is very often part of it. Although parts of film theory and philosophy of film do overlap in both traditions (and since Münsterberg and Arnheim many film theorists have maintained that what they do is also related to the philosophy of film), it is wrong to characterize every “theoretical” reflection on film as philosophical because film theory can also be limited to the analysis of mere technicalities or textual analysis. Here, film theory is not different from literary theory where reflections on authorship or analyses of narrative and genre occur most typically without necessarily receiving the label “philosophy” unless they are imbedded in more “philosophical” considerations. The contemporary Anglophone philosophy of film sees this perspective slightly differently since longstanding reflections on these subjects (by Cavell, Carroll, Bordwell, Gaut, and Branigan) are usually classified as philosophy.

While the degrees of “philosophicality” vary within different interpretations of films, it is safe to assume that any reflective study of the nature of film is philosophical. Whenever scholars attempt to spell out what film is (Is film an art? How is film different from other arts?), their discourse becomes necessarily philosophical. This reflective study is not limited to film, but is true for any academic field (it becomes most obvious in philosophy of science).

Film Aesthetics

Philosophy of film cannot be seen only as a subfield of aesthetics or of the philosophy of art. Philosophy of film also should not be labeled as ‘film aesthetics’. Philosophy of film is able to approach a spectrum of questions so broad that its link with aesthetics can sometimes be maintained only by purely formal reasons. Bergson’s philosophy of film, which has attained a central position in contemporary philosophy of film, was not developed out of an aesthetic interest at all; but film would have served Bergson as merely an illustration for his general philosophical ideas. It is even possible to say that the philosophy of film, just because of its readiness to undertake paradoxical fusions that contrast aesthetics against fields other than aesthetics, develops a discourse that stands out in the entire body of philosophy. Treating, for example, psychoanalytical or cognitive problems as aesthetical phenomena bears an immense critical potential that does not exist to the same extent in other sub-disciplines of philosophy.

Film and Philosophy

Philos-sophia, the ancient Greek term for ‘’love of wisdom’’, can be understood as an immense attempt at interpreting or questioning human existence and the world in its entirety. Logically, film can be one of its subjects. When this is the case, the approach towards film usually exceeds the label of mere interpretation and places film in a relationship with classical philosophical questions such as (its own) essence, truth, or beauty.

Philos-sophia can see film as one of its subjects, but film can also be its object, that is, film can be a philosophy through which a thinker attempts to see the world In other words, film can establish its own stances about essence, truth, or beauty. Theoretically, this can be done with any art form: it is also possible to see painting, literature, or dance as philosophical activities. However, film has been found much more apt for such models because its integrative mode of time, space, images, and movement brings it much closer to thinking (as will be developed below).

The idea of “philosophy of film” is a little like Kant’s “Critique of Pure Reason” because it implies two ideas at the same time. Kant’s title can be understood as (1) “pure reason being criticized” and as (2) “pure reason doing the criticizing.” In the first case, pure reason is a passive object of research undergoing the scrutiny of critical thought while in the second case pure reason is actively imposing its standards on this critical thought. The same is true for the phrase “philosophy of film,” which can mean (1) that film is undergoing a philosophical examination and (2) that film itself helps to develop a certain type of philosophical thinking that will subsequently be imposed upon various subjects of research. Strictly speaking, any outline of the philosophy of film should be divided into two parts: (1) a philosophy about film and (2) film as an philosophy. The latter occupies a prominent place in many recent continental and Anglo-American discourses, and has been defended by Wartenberg (2006), Mulhall (2002), Frampton (2006), and Smuts (2009), and has been criticized by Russell (2000), Murray Smith (2006), Livingston (2009), and Davies (2009). However, in the practice of much of philosophy of film, both approaches often intermingle. Film as a philosophic experience or philosophy as a filmic experience often appear as two sides of the same coin.

Films are similar to dreams and much of what the philosophical tradition has said about the “reality of the outer world” and its skeptical evaluation can be demonstrated through reflections on film. Here film theory maintains a strong contact with philosophy. The distinction between appearance (that is, dream and poiesis) and reality has been on the agenda of film theory for almost eighty years. The “reality and dream” problem is not limited to the subjectivist approach that perceives film as a manifestation of fantasies and hallucinations. However “realists” like André Bazin have classified film as real, because film is able to capture an authentic reality independent of human subjectivity (see below). Comparisons of films and dreams can reveal new concepts of space and time because dreams seem to take place in an intermediary domain of abstractness and concreteness. Film is not, according to Amédée Ayfre, a thesis about the world; rather it presents the world. Any abstractly existential stance contained in this presentation makes film a philosophical phenomenon. Psychoanalysis represents another approach towards dreams and has a status within the philosophy of film which will be explained below.

a. Continental vs. Analytical

Analytical philosophy of film has been unwilling to identify psychoanalytical elements and some sociological elements, in particular approaches of critical theory or ideology critique, as “philosophical” because it deems that this theory does not satisfy more scientific standards. While a continental film scholar like Christian Metz would find the results of the French school of filmology relevant for the most scientific forms of experimental psychology, analytical philosophy usually rejects continental models based on language. These models are usually derived from the Saussurean model of signification and are present in poetics, semiotics or Lacanian psychology. Instead analytical philosophy  favors either cognition-based models or more “classical” questions related to problems such as the ontology of film, analyses of movement, realism, the nature of filmic representation, and explanations of our emotional engagement with fiction. Further, there is in analytical philosophy a strong desire to limit work on the philosophy of film from critical theory and cultural studies practiced in English departments. This problem never occurred in the more eclectic and naturally open field of continental philosophy of film.

Still, in many cases, the distinction between continental and analytical is not easy and does not always pass smoothly along the lines of a European and an American tradition. Although David Bordwell is a cognitive philosopher,  initially he was inspired by Russian formalist terminology and was himself a subject of interest for European semioticians. Though he is one of the most scathing critics of the continental paradigm in film theory (together with Carroll he coined the term “SLAB theory” to refer to theories that use the ideas of Saussure, Lacan, Althusser, and Barthes) (Bordwell & Carroll 1996), his early work is “structuralist” or “Foucaultian” in spirit as it analyzes the rules governing the practice of institutional film criticism/theory.

b. French Philosophy of Film

French philosophy has played an outstanding role in the development of a philosophy of film. Henri Bergson was the first philosopher who adopted film as a conceptual model for philosophical thought. Cinema helped him to imagine the distinction between spatialized time and duration, an idea that would remain essential for his entire philosophy. Though Bergson’s ideas bear no relation with the more contemporary language-based models of reason (and his interpreter Gilles Deleuze never used them in that way), Bergson’s thought fused with the remaining field of French philosophy of cinema in an often paradoxical fashion. Though French philosophy of film is composed of diverse elements, French or even continental philosophy of film can appear as amazingly coherent. Deleuze’s Bergsonian concept of the “time-image,” for example, is very much compatible with ideas elaborated by the Russian director Andrei Tarkovsky who derived his insights not from Bergson, but from a critical evaluation of Russian formalist film theory.

In 1946, Gilbert Cohen Séat published the first monograph on the philosophy of film (Essai sur les principes d’une philosophie du film). Jean Epstein’s L’Intelligence d’une machine, a truly philosophical book on film, appeared in the same year. In 1948, the interdisciplinary Parisian École de Filmologie began approaching film from a sociological, psychological, and philosophical angle. Filmology can be considered as a precursor of the semiology of cinema.

In the 1960’s and 1970’s, many principal theoretical discussions (such as auteur theory and genre theory) were developed in the Parisian journal Les Cahiers du cinéma, co-founded in 1951 by André Bazin. It was in this journal that French philosophy of film began to produce its characteristic mixtures of structuralism, semiotics, psychoanalysis, and Marxism. Paradoxically, the affiliation of filmology with semiotics and psychology – provocative as it might have seemed – provided the philosophy of film access to academia in the 1960’s. For European state-financed universities, film studies could never have been the economic boon as they have been in the United States. French philosophy departments remain resistant in the 21st century and permit the teaching of the philosophy of film only in institutions that are considered off the mainstream or within the newly founded – relatively small – discipline of aesthetics. While the “sociological temptation” exists, overall, French philosophy of film has remained very distinct from the sociology of cinema.

c. Philosophy of Film in Other European Countries

French philosophy of film is a unique phenomenon; no other European country has produced a similarly philosophical output on film. In Italy, Umberto Eco and Pier Paolo Pasolini published writings on film in the 1960s that would quickly be integrated into the French discourse. In Germany, the journal Filmkritik (launched in 1957), was the German equivalent of the Cahiers du cinema, though earlier writings by Frankfurt School members Siegfried Kracauer and Walter Benjamin turned out to be most compatible with French philosophy of film. Different from French and American postwar developments, in Germany, film studies never became institutionalized nor have they developed a consistent link with the praxis of film. German Filmwissenschaft (filmology) – most prominently represented by Thomas Elsaesser – developed along the lines of comparative literature, theater science, and art history rather than plunge into an adventurous speculative discourse. It would be absorbed into academia through the disciplines of Media- and Communication Science. The activities of Filmwissenschaft are diverse though its dominant tendency may be characterized as sociological whereas systematical film analysis is highly empirical. Aestheticians working in German philosophy departments (where the main tendency is analytical) continue the philosophical considerations of film, though hermeneutic film analysis has had some impact.

2. An Overview Of Theories

a. Henri Bergson

In the early 1900’s, Henri Bergson (1859-1941) developed the concepts of “movement-image” and “time-image” (in Matière et memoire), both of which anticipated the development of film theory. Bergson declares the image to be superior to the concept because the image is able to evoke thought content in a more fluent and less abstract fashion. In lectures held at the College de France between 1902-03, Bergson briefly refers to the possibility of “comparing the mechanism of conceptual thought with that of the cinematograph” (now in L’Evolution créatrice, 1991, p. 725, note 1). Bergson’s main philosophical theme is that temporality should be thought of as  independent from concepts of spatiality. Bergson contrasts duration, as it is experienced by the human consciousness, with scientific definitions of time, the latter of which, in his view, tends to “spatialize” time. Ironically, Bergson would later reject any possibility of using film as an exemplification of his ideas, in an essay entitled “The Cinematographic Illusion” (also in L’Evolution créatrice). Subsequent developments of Bergson’s ideas on duration by Epstein, Sartre, or Deleuze go, strictly speaking, against the grain of his original thought on cinema.

b. Hugo Münsterberg

The German-American philosopher and psychologist Hugo Münsterberg (1863-1916) wrote the first book on the philosophy of film entitled Photoplay: A Psychological Study (1916, German: Das Lichtspiel: eine psychologische Studie, 1916). Active during the silent film era, Münsterberg attempted to establish cinema as an art form that is different from theater or photography. Coming to America at the age of thirty-four, Münsterberg had clearly been under Neo-Kantian influence in Germany. Photoplay is divided into two parts, the first of which is inspired by experimental psychology dealing with the mental functions of the spectator. This first part is a precursor to the cognitive theory of film. The second part bears clear traits of Neo-Kantian aesthetics as it analyzes, in a formalist fashion, film’s form and function. The Neo-Kantian input became obvious through Münsterberg’s conviction that film is the mirror of the mind and not that of the world; the goal of cinema is not to reproduce reality, but to materialize emotions. Münsterberg theorized about how close-ups and flashbacks parallel acts of consciousness (that is affect, memory) and formulated the ‘film/mind’ analogy that was much explored and criticized by other philosophers (for example Carroll, 1988b).

c. Formalist Approaches

i. The Russian Formalism Tradition

Russian Formalism designates a school of innovative linguists and literary critics. It developed out of modernist movements such as Russian symbolism and constructivism. From 1915 to 1930, both the Moscow group (led by Roman Jakobson) and the St. Petersburg Society for the Study of Poetical Language (OPOJAZ), which included notorious members like Viktor Shklovsky, Osip Brik, Boris Eikhenbaum, and Vladimir Propp, applied newly invented formalist linguistic methods to the study of literature and poetry. Rediscovered in the West in the 1960’s, the work of the Russian Formalists has had an important influence on structuralist theories of literature, and on some of the more recent varieties of Marxist literary criticism.

Several Russian Formalists wrote on film mainly by establishing analogies between film and language. The idea to interpret film as language goes back, among other things, to Shklovsky’s reaction to the writings of the Ukrainian linguist Alexander Potebnja (1836-1891) who thought of poetry as “thinking in images.” According to Shklovsky, this leads to the false assumption that the creation of symbols is the main cognitive occupation. Shklovsky suggested seeing the activity of thinking as a more abstract and relational way of thinking. This model of thinking comes close to a formalist idea of film. Finally, all artistic activ­ity should be seen as a creative reorganization of pre-aesthetic materials: art need not express new content but should make a strange habitualized form.

For formalism, cinematic time (or cinematic reality altogether) is incompatible with naturalist representations. It is not staged, nor does the director transfer reality on the screen by means of intuition (as does, for example, impressionist painting). For the formalists, time is created through montage. Technical terms such as ‘defamiliarization’ (ostranenie) or the ‘story’ (fabula) as opposed to the ‘plot’ (sjuzhet), have become important in Western European and American film studies. Both Christian Metz (1975) and David Bordwell (1985) borrowed heavily from formalism.

1. Sergei Eisenstein

The director Sergei Mikhailovich Eisenstein remains a central figure in formalist film theory and by helping to develop the above idea of time created through montage. One of Eisenstein’s aims was to overcome, in a formalist fashion, “intuitive creativity” through “rational constructive composi­tion of effective elements” (1988a, I, p. 175). Eisenstein designated artistic activity as the process of organizing raw material. A large part of this cinematic theory is based on a principle similar to what Russian Formalists called ostranenie (alien­ation, estrangement, German: Verfremdung). According to Eisen­stein, within every shot there is a conflict between an object and its spatial nature or between an event and its temporal nature. As a consequence of this conflict, cine­matic time does not exist as “real time,” but must be experienced as an artistic-technical device. For Eisenstein, montage will never produce a “rhythm” or regularly patterned series of shots because such series would still rely too much on “artistic feeling” or empathy.

Eisenstein was the first person who attempted to see cinema as a thinking process. Recognizing that film reconstructs the actions of the human mind, Eisenstein perceived montage form as “a reconstruction of the laws of the thought process” (1988c, p. 236). His theory of dialectical montage (directly referring to Hegel and Marx) suggests that a third idea can emerge from the presentation of two conflicting shots. Related to this is his concept of “shock to thought” which occurs when the conflict between two shots forces us to think its synthesis (1988b, p. 45). Deleuze takes this idea up in Image-Temps and explains that this shock forces thinking to think itself as well as to think the whole (p. 207). Another famous concept is Eisenstein’s idea of cinema as a revolutionary ‘kino-fist’ formulated in reaction against his rival Dziga Vertov’s Kino Eye group (see below). It is difficult to summarize the entire body of Eisenstein’s writings as they teem with unpredictable insights and can certainly not be reduced to formalist recipes towards technicality.

2. Vsevolod Pudovkin

Vsevolod Illarionovitch Pudovkin (1893-1953) elaborated in the late 1920s and early 1930s on a theory of film based on narrative and spatiotemporal continuity. In Kinorezhisser i kinomaterial (1926), Kinoszenarii: Teoria szenarija (1926), and Akter v fil’me (1934) (published in English as Film Technique and Film Acting), Pudovkin examines such devices as contrast, parallelism, and symbolism. Several of Pudovkin’s formulations influenced Rudolf Arnheim (see below).

3. Lev Kuleshov

The idea that editing constitutes the “essence” of film art originated with the Russian director and theoretician Lev Kuleshov (1899-1970) who experimented with montage in the 1920s in an almost scientific fashion and is also one of the key exponents of the ‘film as language’ idea. Thoughts on montage are expressed as early as 1920 in his study “The Banner of Cinematography” (Engl. in Selected Works, 1987, Moscow). Kuleshov was able to show with the help of experiments that an isolated shot has no meaning (the famous Kuleshov effect).

4. Yuri Lotman

The Russo-Estonian semiotician Yuri Mikhailovitch Lotman (1922-1993) set out to reformulate the Saussurean notion of the sign by establishing a relationship of necessity between the signified and the signifier (which Saussure believed to be arbitrary). Lotman was the main proponent of the Tartu-Moscow School and his work is directly linked to the Russian Formalist tradition. He is perhaps most noted for the coinage of the term “semiosphere.” In his Semiotika kino i problemy kinoestetiki (1973) (Semiotics of Cinema), Lotman distinguished between the different levels of illusion and reality in film by analyzing the cinematic shot, narration, as well as the ideological function of cinema as mass-media. His distinction between pictorial/iconic signs used in the visual arts and conventional signs (words, letters) as used in literature had a central position in his work. Lotman also insisted that the cinematic language of a film is always related to exterior cultural codes.

ii. Béla Balász: Film as Language

Béla Balász (1949-1984) was a Hungarian film aesthetician who wrote in Hungarian and German. His books, Der sichtbare Mensch (The Visible Man, 1924) and Der Geist des Films (The Spirit of Film, 1930) were the first theoretical books on film after Münsterberg’s Photoplay. They remain the founding stones of modern film theory though they have been translated into English only in 2010. Balász’s book Theory of the Film (Hungarian, 1948, English 1953) picked up threads from the earlier books and brought him posthumous international fame. In general, Balász strove to offer to modern man possibilities of overcoming his particular state of estrangement by designing a utopian visual culture in which film plays an essential role. Balász’s ambition to describe film as a language brought him close to the Russian Formalists; he was actually able to advance views on montage that would be too mechanistic even for Eisenstein’s standards. However, a genuinely philosophical component enters his work through complex reflections on cinematic “reality.” In Theory of the Film, Balász wrote: “Although objective reality is independent of the subject and his subjective consciousness, beauty is not merely objective reality, not an attribute of the object entirely independent of the spectator, not something that would be there objectively even without a corresponding subject even if there were no human beings on earth” (p. 33). Malcolm Turvey classifies Balász (together with Jean Epstein, Dziga Vertov, and Siegfried Kracauer) as a “revelationist” because for all these theorists, the cinema is a means of enlightenment: it escapes the limits of human sight and reveals the true nature of reality. To some extent, the particular way of tackling the reality problem in film was determined by Balász’s interest in dreams. Two of Balász’s prose works are entitled Youth of a Dreamer and Fairytale, Ritual, and Film, the latter of which testified to his interest in film as “otherworldliness.” Without giving in to mystification and decidedly refusing fades or dissolves, Balász remained fascinated by film’s “ability to transform all things in space into bearers of expressions” and interpreted some original scenes psychoanalytically, such as substantial dream images (cf. Loewi, p. 318).

iii. Mikhail Bakhtin: Dialogicity and Reception

The ‘Bakhtin School’ theorists Mikhail M. Bakhtin, Pavel N. Medvedev, and Valentin N. Voloshinov developed elements of formalism by emphasizing the dialogical and polyphonic character of texts and cultural phenomena. Though the Bakhtin School did not write explicitly on film, it should be mentioned here for two reasons. First, Mikhail Bakhtin’s (1895-1975) writings had indirect influence on the film semiotics of Julia Kristeva and Tzvetan Todorov. Bakhtinian concepts of dialogism and polyphony are crucial because they can help to address fundamental questions about film form and reception. Second, film is an extremely good example for polyphony. While in the novel we most typically encounter the monologic narrator, in the film, the narrative, the character’s appearance, the dialogues, and several other elements appear simultaneously within one time frame (cf. Vice, p. 142). Also, Bakhtin’s central notion of the chronotope exemplifies the fusion of time and space that is typical for film.

iv. Rationalism: Galvano Della Volpe

The Italian Marxist philosopher Galvano Della Volpe (1895-1968), who in 1954 published a book called Il verosimile filmico e altri scritti di estetica, designed a rational aesthetics of film emphasizing unity, coherence, and harmony. Della Volpe formulated an organic theory of literature affirming the rational instead of the sentimental value of the work of art. Art is not distinct from science because both are based on the unity of the concept (in Critica del gusto). Central is Della Volpe’s critique of Crocean idealism, but also of materialism. Della Volpe established an epistemology of art that voluntarily remains indifferent towards social contexts or contents and excels in the analysis of technical, structural or formal processes in art. Della Volpe drew greatly from Aristotle’s Poetics. Emphasizing the analysis of formal aspects, Della Volpe pointed out film’s capacity to present the world symbolically as well as its ability to express abstract concepts. The latter happened for him mainly through montage. Similar to Jean Mitry, Della Volpe criticized the reduction of film to language; furthermore he was inspired by Pudovkin’s distinction between ‘plasticity’ and ‘concreteness’ of filmic images. Finally, Della Volpe established cinematic verisimilitude as non-equivalent to reality.

v. Semiotics/Semiology

Semiotics is the study of signs and symbols and examines how meaning is created and communicated through signifying processes. In France, the term sémiologie is more often used than the term sémiotique, though there does not seem to be a clear distinction between the terms. The discipline of semiology goes back to Ferdinand de Saussure whereas semiotics was founded by Charles Sanders Peirce, who was later taken up by Deleuze (rather than Saussure).

1. Gilbert Cohen-Séat

In 1946, Gilbert Cohen-Séat published the first monograph on film which bears the word “philosophy” in its title (Essai sur les principes d’une philosophie du film). The Revue internationale de filmologie was founded soon afterwards and Cohen-Séat’s name remains linked to filmology. Arguably, his most important contribution to film studies was the distinction between “filmic facts” and “cinematic facts”: “The filmic fact consists of the expression of life (the life of the world, the spirit, the imagination, of beings and things) through a system of combined images (visual-natural or conventional- and auditory-sounds and words). The cinematic fact, instead, consists of social circulation of sensations, ideas, feelings, and materials that come from life itself and that cinema shapes according to its desires,” (Essai…, p. 57). Cohen-Séat’s scientific approach made him a precursor of the semiotics of cinema.

2. Roland Barthes

Roland Barthes’ influence on film theory is similar to that of the Bakhtin school. Though having written almost nothing on film, his narratology that strives to see theatre, photography, and music as texts has deeply influenced our ways of seeing film as the interplay of voices or codes. Paradoxically, this thinker who mused so much about “floating signifiers,” found very disturbing the fact that in films, signifiers are in motion: “The filmic, very paradoxically, cannot be grasped in the film ‘in situation’, ‘in movement’, in its natural state’, but only in that major artifact, the still” (1977, p. 65).

3. Christian Metz

Christian Metz (1931–1994) was the initiator of a film analysis that relies in the most outspoken way on semiotics and is, like Barthes, what the French call a “sémiologue.” In general, Metz’s approach towards cinema has become the prototypical example of a quasi-scientific form of film theory. Apart from linguistic structuralism, Metz borrowed from psychoanalysis, in particular from Jacques Lacan and his writings on the mechanisms of dreams and voyeurism. This allowed him to explain perceptual phenomena of the filmic narrative from the point of view of the perceiving subject and take into consideration the unconscious processes of desire that allegedly position the spectator ideologically. Metz is particularly renowned for his “grand synagmatics” (grande syntagmatique) through which he categorized the most frequent codes and signifying units (called ‘syntagmes’) in cinema. Metz established the single shot as the smallest unit and the entire film as the largest one. He classified all syntagmes in distinct categories, distinguishing, for example, between chronological and a-chronological syntagmes.

According to Metz, cinematic language (langage) is not constituted by all elements that appear in a film, but only by those things that can only appear in film. Film analysis should highlight only those signifying figures that are truly cinematographic. Metz questioned Eisenstein’s vision of cinema as a langue because a langue is a highly organized code, whereas language covers a much broader area. Film should not be seen as langue because cinematic signs are reinvented or are updated in every film (Essais sur la signification, p. 47). Some might find Metz’s approach anti-philosophical because it so vehemently denies the possibility of phenomenological considerations. On the other hand, Metz’s work can be considered as philosophical because it deals with ethical implications (employing Marxist themes) and it extensively discusses the matter of reality and of dreams through a Freudian perspective.

4. Pier Paolo Pasolini

Pier Paolo Pasolini (1922-1975) was, and remains, a relatively little known as a theorist in the United States, but he held a central position in European film theory. Under the influence of Barthes, Metz, and Gramsci, Pasolini’s essays on cinema collected in the book Empirismo Eretico (1972) are exercises in semiotics that raised, in the 1960’s, a debate involving Umberto Eco (1967) and Metz (1968). When Pasolini postulated that cinema is the “written language of reality,” he was not intending to establish cinematic reality as a sort of cinematic language, nor is he preaching realism. Pasolini wants to conceive the real as cinematic. Reality is the discourse of things that cinema re-narrates. This project is highly philosophical and, famously, in 1967 Pasolini remarked, in the Journal of the Communist Party, that “semiotics has not taken the step which would lead it to become a Philosophy.”

d. Cinematographic Ontology and Phenomenology

i. Phenomenology

Phenomenology is a philosophy that goes back to Edmund Husserl and takes as a point of departure a sort of “experience” that is strictly designed as the sensible intuition of phenomena. On the basis of this prescription, phenomenology attempts to understand the essence of what is experienced. Martin Heidegger, though influenced by Husserl, interpreted phenomenology as an ontology, that is, as a discipline attempting to understand the Being of ourselves as Dasein (existence) and preparing for an understanding of the meaning of Being as such. His version is called “existential phenomenology.” Both Husserl’s and Heidegger’s phenomenology remain critical towards metaphysics. In the philosophy of film, the phenomenological, “synthetic” approach has often been opposed to the “analytical,” semiotic one.

1. Maurice Merleau-Ponty

Like Bergson, Merleau-Ponty (1908-1961) criticized all attempts of representing the world in a purely scientific fashion as reductive. In film, the meaning of an image depends on the preceding image and their succession creates a new reality. Merleau-Ponty has had a considerable influence on Cohen-Séat (see Andrew 1978: p. 46). In 1945, Merleau-Ponty devoted a lecture to the possibilities of phenomenological interpretations of cinema (“Le cinéma et la nouvelle psychologie” in Sens et non-sens) where he depicted film not as a sum of images, but as a temporal phenomenon. The central term in Merleau-Ponty’s musings on film is the idea of immersion. For the phenomenologist, humans are thrown into a life world to which they remain attached in the most natural and inconspicuous way. Film provides a phenomenological experience par excellence because in the cinema the human consciousness is consistently immersed in a world. Merleau-Ponty’s ideas never developed into a phenomenological theory of film, but have inspired theorists of Neo-Realism, such as Ayfre and Bazin and have been developed by Vivian Sobchack (1992).

2. Amédée Ayfre

Amédée Ayfre (1895-1963), a student of Merleau-Ponty, rejected formalist components such as style as essential characteristics of cinema and attempted to establish a “phenomenological realism” (Ayfre, 1964: 214) in film studies. In his Conversion aux images (written together with Henri Agel) Ayfre explicitly referred to the phenomenological ambition of strictly adhering to mere descriptions of experience without being influenced by either scientific or psychological considerations of causes (pp. 212-13). Ayfre’s notion of écriture as it appears in the cinéma d’auteur, designated “neither a content nor a style” (1969, p. 162), but attempted to go beyond the division of film into form and content. Phenomenologi­cal existence transgresses constructive devices as well as stylization and Ayfre’s sympathies clearly went towards Neo-Realist cinema (see below). As a Jesuit priest, Ayfre strove to reconcile his existentially-minded phenomenology with his Catholicism. Ayfre’s phenomenological realism is meant to depict a “spiritual” reality and not just a “real” one; it creates an illusion due to a “prodigious asceticism of means.” Ayfre’s concept of realism is diametrically opposed to formalist ideas about “realistic” narrative modes. David Bordwell, for example, believed that realistic expressions can be grasped best through norms and codes which vary according to different criteria, but remain formalizable in the last instance. “Realistic” motivations will be applied according to what the given narrative mode defines as realistic. For Bordwell, “verisimilitude in a classical narrative film is quite different from verisimilitude in the art cinema” (Narration in the Fiction Film, 1985, pp. 153-54). Ayfre, on the other hand, saw cinematic reality as the internal logic of a universe created by the director. Ayfre’s realism was also opposed to psychological interpretations because the reality we encounter in a film is more than merely the subconscious emanation or the reverie of a director. Ayfre’s younger collaborator Henri Agel (1911-2008) pursued a long publishing career and never abandoned the initial tendency, defining himself until the end as a “humanist and a spiritualist”.

ii. Realism:

Realism attempts to recreate life in art by relying on realistic presentation while minimizing controlling devices in the process of artistic production. In literature, realism has been developed by Balzac, Flaubert, and Zola. In film, Italian Neo-Realism is the most important realist movement.

1. André Bazin

The establishment of neo-realist film theory was mainly been the task of André Bazin (1918-1958) and Ayfre. Bazin’s realism was similar to Ayfre’s phenomenological realism, more so since he accepted Merleau-Ponty’s idea of reality as “the pure appearance of everything that is in the world” (“la pure apparence des êtres au monde” (Questions IV, p. 62). In 1957, Bazin openly adopted Ayfre’s expression “phenomenological realism” in order to label the kind of films in which “reality is not modified according to psychological functions or dramatic requirements” (Questions IV, p. 138). Dudley Andrew writes that “Bazin saw in realism a kind of style which reduced signification to a minimum. In other words, he saw the rejection of style as a potential stylistic option” (Andrew, 1976, p. 143).

Together with Alexandre Astruc, Bazin was also responsible for the so-called “auteur theory,” which grew mainly out of the two writers’ works and since has been central for French New Wave cinema. François Truffaut and other Cahiers authors joined later on, as well as Andrew Sarris in the USA. Bazin’s realism had a metaphysically significant backdrop. Like Ayfre’s phenomenological realism, Bazin’s phenomenological ontology was strongly marked by religious convictions. Sometimes terms like “real presence” or “revelation of reality” appear to have almost religious connotations. In this sense, Bazin’s philosophy was essentialist, in spite of the existentialist stances to which he was submitted. Bazin remains one of the most anti-formalist theoreticians. In his opinion, neo-realist films “aim to reduce montage to zero and to transport to the screen reality in its continuity” (p. 146).

2. Siegfried Kracauer

Siegfried Kracauer’s (1889-1966) writings on film were based on sociology and psychology. His conviction that film has a realist character made him a main proponent of cinematic realism and brought him close to Bazin (whom he never mentions). Kracauer based his realism on the resemblance that he perceived between film and photography. For post-surrealists critics such as Bazin and Kracauer, cinema should look for its genuine expression within a kind of realist expression that can be described as the exact opposite of the surrealist cinema of dreams and symbolisms. Interestingly, in the end, Kracauer defined an alternative form of dreamlike realism able to transmit reality “as if it were a dream”. In his Theory of Film he wrote: “Perhaps films look most like dreams when they overwhelm us with the crude and unnegotiated presence of natural objects—as if the camera had just now extricated them from the womb of physical existence and as if the umbilical cord between image and actuality had not yet been severed. There is something in the abrupt immediacy and shocking veracity of such pictures that justifies their identification as dream images” (p. 224).

Like Ayfre, Kracauer was opposed to any stylization of reality: the realistic character of dream elements is compared to those objects that we can find in nature. Kracauer’s realism was not based on calculations with possibilities of literal reproductions, but on the director’s ability to capture a certain spiritual quantity that is supposed to be enclosed to reality. Ayfre’s phenomenological realism, which strove to depict a “spiritual” reality, and not just a “real” one is echoed by Kracauer’s distinction between “photographic reality” and “camera reality” (Theory of Film, p. 150). For Kracauer, it was important that the “the form giving tendency does not rise above the realistic one” (p. 67). Ayfre, Bazin, and Kracauer engaged in paradoxical projects: Ayfre attempted to apply an aesthetic asceti­cism on reality without applying stylization; Bazin attempted to retrieve style by rejecting style; Kracauer attempted to establish a paradoxical balance between realistic and formalizing tendencies.

3. Dziga Vertov

Dziga Vertov’s theory of the “cinema of fact” can be considered a form of cinematic realism. In 1919, Vertov founded the group Kino-oki (“cinema-eyes”) insisting, in various manifestos, that the cinema of the future will not be that of stars and of fiction, but a cinema of facts. Vertov developed a concept of cinema as “life caught in awareness,” in which the camera eye innocently captures reality “as it is” without stylizing it. This clearly joins the ambitions of the neo-realists. The Russian director Andrei Tarkovsky, who was strongly influenced by Vertov and by Russian “Documentary Aesthetics” in the 1960’s, has indeed been likened to Bazin and neo-realism. Jon Beasley-Murray points out that Tarkovsky restored the “actuality of time” by constructing a subjectivity by which this reality is inhabited (1997, p. 47).

iii. Existentialism

1. Alexandre Astruc’s Caméra-Stylo

A disciple of Bazin, Alexandre Astruc (1923-) established in his essay “La Caméra-stylo” (1948) an aesthetics of cinema that based its expressions on the idea of writing rather than on conventional conceptions of the image. The language of film can be shaped until it becomes as subtle as the language of literature. Cinema is not a consecution of images. Instead, it adopts more abstract characteristics because it is able to integrate abstraction in itself. Abstraction is no longer present as an underlying structure of the film (as is the case with montage), but it expresses itself directly: “By language I mean a form in which and by which an artist can express his thoughts, however abstract they may be, or translate his obsessions exactly as he does in the contemporary essay or novel. That is what I would like to call this new age of cinema, the age of caméra-stylo” (Astruc, 1968, p. 18).

Like Bazin’s and Kracauer’s, Astruc’s strategy is directed against surrealist cinema. But it is also directed against conventional documentaries because the caméra-stylo intends to grasp “any kind of reality.” In a film “recorded” by a caméra-stylo there is no evocation of subjective, intimate symbols; nothing has been produced by the artist through the direct transposition of an inner reality; nor is there is any objective recording of reality. Film is not a documentation undertaken from a detached point of view located outside the things filmed. This is why the camera works like a pen: it records concrete reality, but then transforms it instantly into an abstraction. A caméra-stylo can produce an “écriture,” but it would be too simple to say that a film is transformed into literature only because the camera is transformed, in a metaphori­cal way, into a pen. The use of the camera as a pen has more to do with the interplay of realization and abstraction or, to use another term, of stylization. In other words, the writing camera produces style. This makes Astruc’s theory different from “anti-stylization” movements such as realism and (to some extent) phenomenology. However, it is important to understand that the caméra-stylo philosophy does not preach formalist stylization, but attempts to capture style, which makes it, paradoxically, compatible with some realist and phenomenological stances. Marcel Martin goes as far as saying that the “new language” which cinema has discovered makes sense as long as style turns out to be the main protagonist of this medium. “The real main character of this cinema is thus the style (…). The ‘poetic cinema’ (cinéma de poésie) is thus essentially founded on the exercise of style as inspiration” (Martin, 1967, p. 68).

iv. Film as Thought

Jacques Aumont, in A quoi pensent les films?, insists that “film has the power of thinking”. In the introduction of this article, the idea to see film as a form of thinking has been addressed as an important part of the philosophy of film that begins with Eisenstein.

1. Jean Epstein: Film as Artificial Intelligence

The avant-garde director Jean Epstein (1897-1953) remains better known for his theoretical writings than for his films, many of which are no longer extant. Together with Eisenstein, Epstein is a precursor of “cinema as thought” theories. Mixing Eisenstein’s thoughts with Marxism and the intellectual potential flowing out of the French Impressionist School of Film active during the 1920’s, Epstein designs a philosophy that is more reminiscent of Bergson than of formalism and can even be called anti-semiotic. Film is much more than a text or a writing; it is a machine able to produce a dreamlike reality by unhinging the most basic rules of logic and time, and by overcoming human reason.

In his major work L’Intelligence d’une machine (1921), Epstein discovered that cinema as a thinking machine is able to liberate us from the constraints of logic in order to produce a poetic and dreamlike reality. Cinema manipulates space and time. Comparing film with the microscope, it seems that Epstein anticipated contemporary computer reality or virtual reality. Cinema is a “robot brain” (p. 71) able to transcend the physical and mental limits of humans. The cinematograph, like the calculator, is the first materialization of “machines for thinking” (p. 48) and more complex ones will follow. Obviously inspired by Bergson, Epstein observes how cinema stretches and condenses duration and lets us feel the variable and relative nature of time. Cinema thinks time  is a “partial mechanical brain” that develops a “rich philosophy full of surprises” (p. 71). The reality that cinema thinks is “the sum of many irrealities”. For some, Epstein’s theory might smack a little too much of pseudo-science but he plausibly defines cinema as a “machine for producing dreams” (p. 55).

2. Jean Mitry

Some might remember Jean Mitry (1907-1988) as an “anti-semiologist” film thinker because of his harsh criticism of Christian Metz in La Sémiologie en question (1987). Still this theorist and film maker has his own semiotic past. In 1963, the publication of the two volumes of Esthétique et psychologie du cinéma was seen as a major event in the world of French cinema theory. The highly synthetic book deals with all thinkable subjects and accepts some of Bazin’s realism as well as several formalist patterns, but does not – though the title might suggest this – engage in Freudian psychoanalytical elaborations. Mitry’s method was that of perceptual psychology and his refusal of Bazin’s ambition to discover in cinema a “world beyond the world” is absolute. A philosophical input comes from another side. Mitry was asking himself if “filmic language does not reflect thought in the way in which it produces itself [‘en train de se faire’] much better than could do words (…) which only crystallize thoughts in the form of more or less independent ideas by translating a thought that is already achieved” (p. 90). It becomes clear here that Mitry working within the thread of those “Cinema as Thought” theorists presented in the present sub-chapter. Mitry found cinema to be unique in that it signifies only while functioning (p. 63). It is thus consistent that he reproaches, in La Sémiologie en Question, Christian Metz (his admirer) his reductive application of linguistics to film because the language of film is not based on words. Mitry’s position can be summarized as that of a phenomenology of perception and his work often proceeds synoptically with the precision of a historian.

3. Gilles Deleuze

Deleuze’s (1925-1995) analysis of cinema was founded on Bergson’s work Matière et memoire and C. S. Peirce’s taxonomy of signs. Deleuze’s engagement with both represents a rupture with the Saussureian linguistic semiotic tradition. Deleuze rejected “linguistic” as well as psychoanalytic models of film theorisation. Like Mitry, Deleuze believed that film, as it represents and reflects on time, is incompatible with language; for him, the pre-signifying ‘signaletic material’ that films are made of was not assimilable to models of semiotics. In this regard, Deleuze anticipated a number of analytic-cognitivist film theorists.

Similar to Epstein, Deleuze believed that film can alter our modes of thinking about movement and time. In a Bergsonian way, Deleuze put forward that cinematic experience was as a means to perceive time and movement as a whole. The starting point of Bergson’s philosophy was the distinction between temporal and spatial reality. Bergson modified the traditional relationship between unity and repetition by attributing singularity to time and discontinuity to space. Lived time and measured time should not be confused. Bergson’s thesis is that the human who looks at the clock perceives merely juxtapositions of different positions of the hand, which bear no link among themselves. Only the ‘I’ (consciousness) experiences a time whose essence is duration. Correspondingly, Deleuze held that in cinema, our mind does not need to put together the successive percepts or sensations it perceives; rather it receives them as a whole.

Deleuze seemed to be going back in time as he attempted to base his theory of cinema on a point before the semiotic tradition and even before Shklovsky’s formalism which strove to overcome Potebnja’s model of “thinking in images.” More precisely, Deleuze held that films do not think with simple images, but with movement-images and time-images. In his two monumental books on cinema, “Image-Mouvement” (Cinéma I) and “Image-Temps” (Cinéma II), Deleuze engaged the entire history of cinema in order to show a difference between these two types of images. Frequently, we encounter the movement-image, which is based on a sensory-motor scheme (it shows an action, which produces a reaction). In the movement-image, the action imposes itself upon time, it is the action which determines the duration of a scene and the next scene is a reaction to this action (see Deleuze 1984). The time-image, on the other hand, is based on pure thinking. The time-image emerged in cinema after WWII mainly with Italian Neo-Realism and French New Wave cinema. It does not follow the scheme of action-reaction, but it can evoke a time that is prior to movement. Time-images do not simply show us actions and movements, but different layers of time, all of which converge within single points of present. These images can express a present that constantly reaches for the past and for the future.

Deleuze brought film studies closer to philosophy. For Deleuze, film was superior to other arts because it combines time and movement in such a necessary fashion. More than that, cinema must be considered as a philosophy because it constructs its own “concepts.” Cinema is not an applied philosophy submitted to traditional philosophical concepts, but it develops “cinematic” concepts. It does not simply represent reality, but is in itself an ontological practice. Therefore cinema is more than simply an art. In this sense, Deleuze was doing neither film theory nor aesthetics, but he thinks of film as a philosophy. In Deleuze’s earlier writings, art is able to draw on concepts and therefore not confined to percepts or ‘blocs of sensation.’ However, even here Deleuze did not recommend extracting as many concepts as possible from cinema: “A theory of cinema is not about cinema but about the concepts sparked by cinema” (p. 365). Later, in What is Philosophy? (1991), Deleuze (and his co-writer Felix Guattari) reserved “concepts” for philosophy only and declared that cinema thinks with affects and precepts.

Cinema’s highest objective is nothing other than promoting thought and the functioning that comes from thinking. This is what makes cinema different from mere dreams which, in Deleuze’s view, are not thinking. Bad films do nothing more than induce a dream in the spectators (Image-temps, p. 219), they simply reiterate sensory-motor clichés that provoke neither thought or affect.

4. Filmosophy

More recently, Daniel Frampton has added a brick to the wall called “Film as Thought” by insisting that film does not narrate or show things, characters, or actions. Instead, it thinks them. When watching a film we observe a thinking process. In his book Filmosophy (2006) Frampton attempts to grasp this cinematic thinking process with the help of newly coined concepts such as ‘film-thinking’ and ‘filmind’ and assigns to ‘filmosophy’ the task of “conceptualizing all film as an organic intelligence” (p. 7). Film-thinking is not a metaphorical way of arranging reality, but “the filmind has its own particular film-phenomenology, its own way of attending to its world” (p. 91). There is a film-like way of thinking. Philosophers like Bachelard, for example, were able to produce “a flow that weaves discourses together, yet still with rigor and meaning” (p. 179). Although philosophers can learn from film-thinking, Frampton insists that “film has its own kind of thinking” (p. 23), that it “cannot show us human thinking, [but that] it shows us ‘film-thinking’” (p. 47). Thinking is radically removed from the activity of merely processing data.

v. Film as Poetic Art: Susanne Langer

Susanne Langer’s philosophy of film drew very much upon the analogy of film and dream. Langer was an American pragmatist philosopher close to the continental tradition. She was also a frequent reference point in analytic philosophy of film (for example, in Carroll). For Langer, cinema is an art that has introduced the “dream mode” as its main artistic expression, a mode that finally enables cinema to estab­lish itself as an independent medium. Still, film is not a daydream – which is but a wilful imitation of a dream. In her essay “A Note on Film,” Langer wrote: “[Film] is not any poetic art we have known before; it makes the primary illusion—virtual history—in its own mode. This is, essentially, the dream mode. I do not mean that it copies dream, or puts one into a daydream. Not at all, no more than literature invokes memory, or makes us believe that we are remember­ing’’ (p. 200).

e. Psychology/Psychoanalysis

Psychological film theory began with the publication of Münsterberg’s Photoplay, in which the first part is inspired by experimental psychology. In remainder of the twentieth century, more philosophical approaches would use psychoanalysis for the decoding of unconscious elements that were supposed to contain truth by reading films through schemes of symbolization and representation. These approaches are current in the continental tradition.

i. Rudolf Arnheim

Rudolf Arnheim (1904-2007) published Film als Kunst (Film as Art) in 1932, defending film as a form of art distinct from the productions of the entertainment industry. Historically, Arnheim’s main writings on film can be situated between Münsterberg and Balász. Later Arnheim founded a full-fledged aesthetics on the theory of perception and gestalt theory (especially in Art and Visual Perception, 1954). Comments on film are sparse in Arnheim’s later work, but the following quotation, which links film interpretation to Freudian psychology, is remarkable because it addresses a possible extension of the Freudian vision of dream into Arnheim’s own domain. In Visual Thinking (1969), Arnheim pointed to a fundamental link between film and dream that psychology should follow: “Freud raises the question of how the important logical links of reasoning can be repre­sented in images. An analogous problem, he says, exists for the visual arts. There are indeed parallels between dream images and those created in art on the one hand, and the mental images serving as the vehicle of thought on the other; but by noting the resemblance one also becomes aware of the differences, and these can help to characterize thought imagery more precisely” (p. 241).

1. Psychoanalysis vs. Cognitive Science

Reflections on the relationship between the spectator and the film have become particularly central in French film theory since the publication of Christian Metz’s Le signifiant imaginaire: psychoanalyse et cinéma (1977) and Metz’s Lacanian developments as well as the writings of Jean Louis Baudry. For psychoanalysis, the proximity between film and dream is essential because film interpretation is seen as a sort of Freudian dream interpretation. Almost half a century after Arnheim’s above remark, psychoanalytical film theory is still struggling to explain the ways in which unconscious elements obstruct the reception of films and to understand how films spark unconscious or irrational processes. This approach can be understood as diametrically opposed to that of cognitive science which is also interested in how spectators make sense of and respond to films, but which observes the viewer’s conscious processing of films.

ii. The Mindscreen Theory

Bruce F. Kawin began his book Mindscreen: Bergman and First-Person Film (1978) with the question: “Film is a dream—but whose?” (p. 3). Kawin claimed that dreamlike films are self-conscious artworks in which narrative voices have been “generalized” up to a point that we perceive the artworks themselves as if they appear on a “dream screen.” Kawin adopted the idea of the dream screen from the American Psycholo­gist Bertram D. Lewin (1950) whose ideas had, in their time, contributed in an outstanding way to an increasing interest in dreams in post-Freudian America. In an article entitled “Interferences from the Dream Screen,” Lewin declared: “In a previous communication, a special structure, the dream screen was distin­guished from the rest of the dream and defined as the blank background upon which the dream picture appears to be projected. The term was suggested by the action pictures because, like the analogue in the cinema, the dream screen is either not noted by the dreaming spectator, or it is ignored due to the interest in the pictures and actions that appear on it’’ (p. 104).

Kawin’s contribution to film theory consists of examining the validity of the dream screen (or mindscreen) in cinema providing clues to particularities of the narrative structure of film. In Bergman’s Persona, for example, there is “an impression of the mindscreen’s being generalized,” so that the film’s self-consciousness appears to originate from within. Being identified neither with a specific character nor with the filmmaker, the “potential linguistic focus” takes on the characteristics of a mindscreen: “The film becomes first-person, it speaks itself” (Kawin, pp. 113-14). Kawin anticipates Frampton’s ‘filmind’.

iii. Slavoj Žižek

Given his use of psychoanalysis and Marxism, the extremely influential Slovenian philosopher Slavoj Žižek (1949-) is a typical representative of continental film theory, the more so since he has explicitly opposed Anglo-American, empirical approaches (see “Introduction to 2001”). Žižek uses Lacanian concepts and insights (most importantly his notion of the Other) and works with concepts derived from the philosophies of Derrida and Deleuze, such as a decentralized notion of the subject. The value of his philosophy of film, developed in numerous books, seems to reside mainly in his consistent and original application of abstract theories to films though he has also submitted various concepts to original developments. His writings do not represent philosophy of film as such; rather they are attempts to read ideology by analyzing contemporary popular films.

f. Walter Benjamin and the Frankfurt School

Like Siegfried Kracauer, Walter Benjamin (1892-1940) belongs to the Frankfurt School of philosophy. Benjamin believed that the techniques of reproduction can be used for the reproduction of traditional works only, and also as new modes of representation. Benjamin’s theory of film is sometimes associated with that of cinematographic realism. Most famously, in his essay Das Kunstwerk im Zeitalter seiner technischen Reproduzierbarkeit [The Work of Art in the Age of Mechanical Reproduction] (1935), Benjamin interpreted modifications of the original through the process of reproduction, as a loss of the work’s aura.

Benjamin favored an allegorical kind of photography (that is definitely opposed to the art of montage), examples of which he found in early photography because it can be perceived something like an aura: “In the fleeting expression of a human face seen in early photographs, the aura shows itself for the last time. This is what makes their melan­cholic and thus incomparable beauty” (I, 2, p. 445). Like Epstein, Benjamin believed that cinema can provide us with extraordinary access to reality: the details that are produced by the close-up or the forms that are revealed by slow motion can “give us access to the experience of an optical unconscious just like psychoanalysis offers us the experience of the instinctive unconscious” (p. 460). In this sense, knowledge about the world is a matter of a sudden “awakening” to the world and this world can be a cinematic world.

Theodor W. Adorno (1903–1969), another member of the Frankfurt School, would transform Benjamin’s notion of “mass culture” into that of the “Kulturindustrie,” in which he saw as a systematized commodification encompassing ‘high’ and ‘mass’ art. This stands in contrast to Benjamin’s view of popular or mass culture as concealing a certain emancipatory potential to be unleashed by dialectical criticism. In their book Dialectic of Enlightenment (1972), Adorno and Max Horkheimer (1895–1973), developed a cultural critique that contains some dispersed but pertinent references to the culture industry of film excelling in standardized production techniques and catering for commercial and not for cultural purposes.

g. Hermeneutic Film Analysis

The hermeneutic approach is based on the interpretation of texts and detects the semantic potential of a text as well as its different levels of meanings. Hermeneutics can be seen as a branch of phenomenology and many of Ayfre’s and Agel’s texts bear traces of hermeneutic thinking. Still, in film analysis its method has mainly been developed in proximity with the interpretation of literature. Though hermeneutics of film explains the semiotic status of iconic signs, it never engages in the construction of semiotic systems because it is constantly aware of the historicity of any analysis. Today, hermeneutic film analysis is mainly practiced in German academic departments of Media and Communication Science. Moreover, such analysis has been brought to a point by Anke-Marie Lohmeier.

h. Future Perspectives

The future of continental philosophy of film will probably be developed in several areas. Žižek’s Lacanian approach, as long as it does not entirely enter the stream of cultural studies, will attract philosophers who deem that ideology should be the primary focus of cinema studies. Another area that might develop is the one pioneered by Bruce Kawin and Daniel Frampton, who provide a vocabulary for describing our aesthetic experience of film that transcends both Deleuze’s conceptual analyses of movement and time and phenomenological approaches. It clearly opens up philosophy to new ways of thinking. Equally promising is a whole range of “crossovers,” such as those that combine semiotic and cognitive paradigms of which Warren Buckland’s The Cognitive Semiotics of Film (2000) is an example. Other crossovers synthesize Deleuzian film theory and phenomenology (Shaw 2008), or the Cavellian-Wittgensteinian approach with continental philosophy (of which Stephen Mulhall is an example).

3. References and Further Reading

  • Agel, Henri. Esthétique du cinéma. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1957.
  • Aitken, Ian. European Film Theory and Cinema: A Critical Introduction. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2001.
  • Allen, Richard and Murray Smith. Film Theory and Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1997.
  • Andrew, Dudley J. Major Film Theories: An Introduction. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1976.
  • Arnheim, Rudolf. Visual Thinking. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1969.
  • Astruc, Alexandre. “The Birth of a New Avant-Garde: La Caméra-Stylo,” in Graham, Peter, ed., The New Wave. London: Secker and Warburg, 1968.
  • Aumont, Jacques. A quoi pensent les films? Paris: Séguier, 1996.
  • Ayfre, Amédé. Conversion aux images? Paris: Cerf, 1964.
  • Ayfre, Amédé. Le Cinéma et sa vérité. Paris: Cerf, 1969.
  • Bakhtin, Mikhail. The Dialogic Imagina­tion. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1981.
  • Balász, Béla. Theory of the Film. New York: Arno Press, 1972.
  • Balázs, Béla. Early Film Theory: Visible Man and The Spirit of Film (trans. Rodney Livingstone, ed. by Erica Carter). New York: Berghahn, 2010.
  • Barthes, Roland. Image-Music-Text. New York: Hill and Wang, 1977.
  • Bazin, André. Qu’est-ce que le cinéma? Vol. I-IV. Paris: Cerf, 1985 [1958].
  • Beasley-Murray, Jon. “Whatever Happened to Neorealism? Bazin, Deleuze, and Tarkovsky’s Long Take,” in D.N. Rodowick, ed., Gilles Deleuze, philosophe du cinéma/Gilles Deleuze, philosopher of cinema, special issue of Iris 23 (Spring 1997), 37-52
  • Benjamin, Walter. Das Kunstwerk im Zeitalter seiner technischen Reproduzierbarkeit [1935] in Gesammelte Werke 1:2, ed. by R. Tiedemann and H. Schweppenhäuser. Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1980., p. 431-469. Engl.: The Work of Art in the Age of its Technological Reproducibility, and other Writings on Media. Boston: Belknap Press of Harvard University Press, 2008.
  • Bergson, Henri. L’Evolution créatrice Paris: Alcan,1991 [1907].
  • Bergson, Henri. Matière et memoire. Paris: Presses universitaires françaises, 1939.
  • Bordwell, David and Noël Carroll, (ed.). Post-Theory: Reconstructing Film Studies. Madison: University of Wisconsin Press, 1996.
  • Bordwell, David. Narration in the Fiction Film. London: Methuen, 1985.
  • Branigan, Edward. Projecting a Camera: Language-Games in Film Theory. New York: Routledge, 2006.
  • Buckland, Warren. The Cognitive Semiotics of Film. Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Carroll, Noël. “Film/Mind Analogies: The Case of Hugo Munsterberg“ in Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 46:4, 188, pp. 489-499.
  • Carroll, Noël. Mystifying Movies: Fads and Fallacies in Contemporary Film Theory. New York: Columbia University Press, 1988.
  • Carroll, Noel. Philosophical Problems of Classical Film Theory. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1988.
  • Carroll, Noël. Philosophical Problems of Classical Film Theory. Princeton University Press.
  • Casetti, Francesco. Theories of Cinema 1945-1995. Austin: Texas University Press, 1999.
  • Cohen-Séat, Gilbert. Essai sur les principes d’une philosophie de cinéma. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1958.
  • Curran, Angela & Thomas Wartenberg (eds.). The Philosophy of Film. London: Blackwell, 2005.
  • Davies, David. The Thin Red Line. London: Routledge, 2009.
  • Deleuze, Gilles & Felix Guattari. Qu’est-ce que la philosophie? Paris: Minuit, 1991. Engl.: What Is Philosophy? (trans. Tomlinson and G. Burchell) Columbia University Press, 1994.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Cours de G. Deleuze du 31/01/84, voir
  • Deleuze, Gilles. L’Image-mouvement. Cinéma 1. Paris: Minuit Paris, 1983.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. L’Image-temps. Cinéma 2. Paris: Minuit, 1985. Engl. transl. of both volumes: Cinema (trans. H. Tomlinson and B. Habberjam). Minneapolis : University of Minnesota Press, 1986-1989.
  • Della Volpe, Galvano. Il verosimile filmico e altri scritti di estetica. Rome: Filmcritica, 1954.
  • Eagle, Herbert. Russian Formalist Film Theory. Ann Arbor: Michigan Slavic Publica­tions, 1981.
  • Eco, Umberto. “Sulle articolazioni del codice cinematogra­fico” [1967] in Per una nuova critica. Venezia: Marsilio Editori, 1989, p.389-396.
  • Eisenstein, Sergei. 1988c. Selected Works 1: Writings 1922-34. London: BFI.
  • Eisenstein, Sergei. On Disney (trans. A. Upchurch). New York: Methuen, 1988b.
  • Eisenstein, Sergei. Writings. Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 1988a.
  • Epstein, Jean. L’Intelligence d’une machine. Paris: Jacques Melot, 1946.
  • Frampton, Daniel. Filmosophy. London, New York: Walflower, 2006.
  • Gaut, Berys. A Philosophy of Cinematic Art. Cambridge University Press, 2010.
  • Goodnow, Katherine J. Kristeva in Focus: From Theory to Film Analysis. Fertility, Reproduction & Sexuality. New York: Berghahn, 2010.
  • Kawin, Bruce F. Mindscreen: Bergman, Godard and First-Person Film. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1975.
  • Kracauer, Siegfried. Theorie des Films. Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1973. Engl.: Theory of Film: The Redemption of Physical Reality. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1960.
  • Langer, Susanne. “A Note on Film” in R. D. Maccann (ed.), Film: A Montage of Theories. New York: Dutton, 1966.
  • Lemon, L. and Reis, M. Russian Formalist Criticism: Four Essays. Lincoln: University of Nebraska Press, 1965.
  • Livingston, Paisley. Cinema, Philosophy, Bergman: On Film as Philosophy. Oxford University Press, 2009.
  • Loewy, Hanno. Béla Balázs – Märchen, Ritual und Film. Berlin: Vorwerk 8, 2003.
  • Lohmeier, Anke-Marie. Hermeneutische Theorie des Films. Tübingen: Niemeyer, 1996.
  • Lotman, Yuri. Semiotika kino i problemy kinoestetiki. Tallinn: Eesti Raamat 1973. Engl.: Semiotics of Cinema (Michigan Slavic Contributions 5.) Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press, 1976.
  • Martin, Marcel. “Ingmar Bergman’s Persona” in Cinema, 119, 1967.
  • Merleau-Ponty, Maurice. Sens et non-sens. Paris: Nagel, 1948.
  • Metz, Christian. “Le signifiant imaginaire” in Communications 23, pp. 3-55, 1975.
  • Metz, Christian. “Fiction Film and its Spectator: A Metaphysical Study” in New Literary History 8:1, 1976.
  • Metz, Christian. Essais sur la Signification au Cinéma, Vol. I. Paris: Klincksieck, 1968.
  • Metz, Christian. Psychoanalysis and Cinema: The Imaginary Signifier. London: Macmillian, 1983.
  • Mitry, Jean. Esthétique et psychologie du cinéma, 2 Vol. Paris: Éditions Universitaires, 1963. Engl.: The Aesthetics and Psychology of the Cinema. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2000.
  • Mitry, Jean. La Sémiologie en Question. Paris : Cerf, 1987.
  • Mulhall, Stephen. On Film: Thinking in Action. London: Routledge, 2002.
  • Peirce, C. S. Peirce on Signs: Writings on Semiotic (ed. James Hoopes). Chapel Hill: University of North Carolina, 1994.
  • Polan, Dana B. “Roland Barthes and the Moving Image” in October 18, 1981, 41-46.
  • Pudovkin, Vsevolod. Film Technique and Film Acting. New York: Bonanza Books, 1949.
  • Rancière, Jacques, La Fable cinématographique. Paris: Le Seuil, 2001.
  • Rancière, Jacques, Le Destin des images. Paris: La Fabrique, 2003. Engl.: The Future of the Image. London: Verso, 2007.
  • Rancière, Jacques, Le Spectateur émancipé. Paris: La Fabrique, 2008. Engl.: The Emancipated Spectator. London: Verso, 2010.
  • Read, Rupert and Jerry Goodenough (eds.). Film as Philosophy: Essays on Cinema after Wittgenstein and Cavell. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2005.
  • Rushton, Richard & Gary Bettinson. 2010. What is Film Theory? London: Open University Press.
  • Russell, Bruce. “The Philosophical Limits of Film” in Film and Philosophy, Special Edition, 2000, pp. 163-167.
  • Shaw, Daniel. Film and Philosophy: Taking Movies Seriously. London: Wallflower Press, 2008.
  • Shaw, Spencer. Film Consciousness: From Phenomenology to Deleuze. Jefferson, NC: McFarland, 2008.
  • Smith, Murray & Thomas Wartenberg (eds.). Thinking through Cinema: Film as Philosophy. Malden, MA: Blackwell, 2006.
  • Smuts, Aaron. “Film as Philosophy: In Defense of a Bold Thesis” in Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 67:3, 2009, pp. 409-420.
  • Sobchack, Vivian. The Address of the Eye: A Phenomenology of Film Experience. Princeton University Press, 1992.
  • Stam, Robert. Film Theory: An Introduction. Oxford: Blackwell, 1999.
  • Todorov, Tzvetan. Poétique. Paris: Seuil, 1973. Engl.: Introduction to Poetics. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1981.
  • Turvey, Malcolm. Doubting vision: Film and the Revelationist Tradition. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2008.
  • Vice, Sue. Introducing Bakhtin. Manchester: Manchester University Press, 1997.
  • Wartenberg, Thomas E. Thinking on Screen: Film as Philosophy. London: Routledge, 2007.
  • Žižek, Slavoj. Everything You Always Wanted to Know about Lacan (But were Afraid to ask Hitchcock). London: Verso, 1992.
  • Žižek, Slavoj. Gaze and Voice as Love Objects. Durham: Duke University Press, 1996.
  • Žižek, Slavoj. The Fright of Real Tears: Krszystof Kieślowski Between Theory and Post-Theory. London: British Film Institute, 2001.

Author Information

Thorsten Botz-Bornstein
Gulf University

Medieval Theories of Aesthetics

The term ‘aesthetics’ did not become prominent until the eighteenth century in Germany; however, this fact does not prevent principles of aesthetics from being present in the Middles Ages. Developments in the Middles Ages paved the way for the future development of aesthetics as a separate discipline. Building on notions from antiquity (most notably Plato and Aristotle) through Plotinus, the medieval thinkers extended previous concepts in new ways, making original contributions to the development of art and theories of beauty.

Certain topics, such as proportion, light, and symbolism, played important roles in medieval aesthetics, and they will be given prominence in this article. Proportion was particularly important for architecture, which is apparent in the cathedrals. Medieval thinkers were also interested in the concept of light: what it is and how it affects everything, especially color. Symbolism was based on the view that the creation revealed God; therefore, symbolic meaning could be communicated through artwork, in particular to those who are illiterate.

Three philosophers, St. Augustine, Pseudo-Dionysius and St. Thomas Aquinas, provided significant contributions to aesthetic theory during the Middle Ages. These three philosophers employed the two predominant approaches to philosophy in the Middle Ages. Augustine and Pseudo-Dionysius were mainly influenced by Plato and Neoplatonism, while Thomas was mostly influenced by Aristotle. Due to their impact on the history of philosophy (in particular, aesthetics), these philosophers will be given more detailed treatment.

Table of Contents

  1. Influences on the Medieval Philosophers
    1. Plato
    2. Aristotle
    3. Plotinus
  2. Topics in Aesthetics
    1. Proportion
    2. Light and Color
    3. Symbolism
  3. Individuals on Aesthetics
    1. St. Augustine
    2. Pseudo-Dionysius
    3. St. Thomas Aquinas
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Influences on the Medieval Philosophers

a. Plato

Plato’s philosophy enjoyed a noticeable presence during the medieval period, especially in the writings of Augustine and Pseudo-Dionysius. The doctrine of the Forms was particularly salient.  According to Plato, there is a perfect Form of Beauty in which beautiful things participate.  For thinkers such as Augustine and Pseudo-Dionysius, platonic forms (including the form of Beauty) are in fact ideas in the mind of God, and the world is but a shadow of the divine image.  On this view, all beautiful things participate not in some abstract universal, but in God’s beauty.  Given Plato’s obvious influence on subsequent theories of aesthetics, further consideration of his views would be helpful.

Plato’s most prominent contribution to aesthetics is his notion of mimesis (imitation). Mimesis derives from the idea that beautiful things are mere replicas of Beauty itself. So conceived, beautiful things participate in the Forms by means of imitation. Moreover, Plato thought that the artist could only imitate sensible objects (or actions) which are themselves imitations of some form. On his view, such imitation results from a lack of knowledge of the Forms, the true essences of which artistic representations are but deficient approximations. Therefore, such representation is “far removed from the truth” (Plato, Republic, 598b5).  Plato famously illustrates this point through the example of a bed (Plato, Republic, 597b ff.). There is a perfect Form of a bed, which exists as the nature of a bed. Then, a carpenter makes a bed. Lastly, a painter paints a picture of the bed that the carpenter constructed. The painter’s imitation is three times removed from the true nature (or Form) of the bed.

A further aspect of imitation that concerned Plato was its socially corrosive influence. The concern is raised most notably in connection to poetry and staged tragedies. For example, if the youth see evil men prosper in plays, then the youth will be more inclined to become evil. “For that reason, we must put a stop to such stories, lest they produce in the youth a strong inclination to do bad things” (Republic 391e). Plato’s concern with how art affects people is also a concern for the medieval philosophers. Mimetic arts were forbidden from Plato’s ideal city, even those that would attempt to imitate the virtues. Plato allowed only those works of art that would perform some didactic function. The Catholic Church, during the medieval period, also used art to perform a didactic function, especially to communicate the faith to the illiterate.

b. Aristotle

Although Plato’s influence, in most areas of philosophy, was initially stronger, Aristotle’s system of logic dominated medieval philosophy. Eventually, through the writings of Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas, the  balance of Aristotle’s philosophy achieved greater respect than it had in the eyes of Christian philosophers and theologians. Of particular interest is Aristotle’s metaphysics. The concept of form, especially in terms of formal causality, provided a ground for later theories of beauty, which connected the beauty of an object to its form. In other words, an object’s form is the cause of its beauty. The main difference between Aristotle’s notion of form and Plato’s notion of the Forms is that Aristotle thought the form of the object was constituted by the essential or species-defining properties inhering in the object.  Plato maintained that the Forms of each thing existed in a realm that transcended physical things.

Another concept relevant for medieval aesthetics is found in the Metaphysics (see III.3), where Aristotle presented the foundation for the medieval notion of transcendentals. He specifically highlighted the interchangeable relationship between being and one. Though Aristotle never called them transcendentals, he prompted this conception by claiming that the notions “being” and “one” are the same. “[Being and unity] are implied in one another as principle and cause are.” (Metaphysics, 1003b23). Transcendentals transcend traditional Aristotelian categories. They are interchangeable with each other, and they are inseparable in terms of their ontological status. Transcendentals (more in subsection 3.c St. Thomas Aquinas) were particularly important to such thinkers as Thomas Aquinas, Avicenna, and Averroes.

Aristotle’s Poetics also contains several ideas that were important for medieval aesthetics. First, consider Aristotle’s notion of imitation. He writes, “A tragedy, then, is the imitation of an action that is serious and also, having magnitude, complete in itself; in language with pleasurable accessories, each kind brought in separately in the parts of the work; in a dramatic, not in narrative form; with incidents arousing pity and fear, wherewith to accomplish its catharsis of such emotions” (Aristotle, Poetics, 1449b25). Aristotle’s notion of mimesis is similar to the view of Plato, since they both claim that art imitates nature. However, Aristotle does not think that nature imitates the realm of the Forms. While Plato thinks that imitations are deficient replicas of real essences, Aristotle believes that imitation is natural and can also be used to educate (Poetics 1448b7).

Second, consider the notion of catharsis, developed in connection to Aristotle’s definition of tragedy. Aristotle uses this word twice in the Poetics (1449b7; 1455b15); it seems that he believed a tragedy could cleanse negative emotions such as fear and pity.

Finally, Aristotle emphasized some characteristics that art requires in order to be good. “Beauty is a matter of size and order” (Aristotle, Poetics, 1450b37). Size is important because something too small or too large is beyond one’s capacity to perceive the whole, which specifically related to the length of plays. Order concerns the relationship of the parts with each other and with the whole, which was also very important to medieval philosophers and artisans.

c. Plotinus

The Neoplatonic philosopher Plotinus provided two main contributions to guide medieval thinking on aesthetics. First, Plotinus made it clear that beauty chiefly applies to the sense of sight and hearing (Plotinus I.6.1), which was maintained in the Middle Ages. This notion is not only a contribution to a theory of beauty, but it delineates two senses as having primacy over the others for the acquisition of knowledge. And beauty, for the medieval philosophers, was frequently connected with knowledge.

Second, Plotinus argued against the notion that proportion is the primary component of beauty. “Almost everyone declares that symmetry of parts towards each other and towards a whole, with, besides, a certain charm of color, constitutes the beauty recognized by the eye, that in visible things, as indeed in all else, universally, the beautiful thing is essentially symmetrical, patterned” (Plotinus I.6.1). Plotinus proceeds to argue that simple things could not be beautiful, if symmetry was the only component of beauty. In other words, only compound things could be beautiful in a proper sense, if beauty depended on symmetry. Moreover, only the whole object would be beautiful, not its parts. The problem, for Plotinus, is that if something is beautiful, it must be composed of beautiful parts. If the parts are not symmetrical in themselves, then they could not be beautiful. This fact leads to an absurd conclusion, according to Plotinus; namely, a beautiful object could be composed of ugly parts. Plotinus does not suggest that symmetry is irrelevant or unnecessary for beauty; his point is that symmetry cannot be the only standard by which to measure an object’s beauty.

2. Topics in Aesthetics

a. Proportion

Proportion was very important to the medieval artisans, especially for architecture and music. In architecture, the primacy of proportion is most clearly seen in the cathedrals. Some cathedrals, from an aerial viewpoint, were in the shape of a cross. This shape also created a balance when viewed from within the cathedral. Paintings  had to exhibit balance in their compositions and it was important for music to exhibit harmony, in order for it to be beautiful.

The Pythagoreans are credited as being the first to study the relationships between numbers and sounds. They discovered certain pitches and proportions to be more pleasing to people than others, and these discoveries were propagated in the middle ages. Boethius writes in De Musica, “Nothing is more proper to human nature than to abandon oneself to sweet modes and to be vexed by modes that are not” (quoted in Eco, 2004, 62). Harmony has its origin in God; and therefore, music designed to bring one closer to God must be harmonious. The psychological effect of various musical modes was an important part of the theories of music. For example, some rhythms were considered to lead people more easily into lustful sins, while other rhythms were deemed appropriate for the education of young people. The earliest example of the effects of music was the story of Pythagoras allegedly calming a drunk adolescent simply by making the youth listen to a certain melody (in Hypophrygian mode). Music could influence the soul of human beings; therefore, the type of music people could hear had to be the sort that would positively influence them.

“The proportions that govern the dimensions of Greek temples, the intervals between the columns or the relationships between the various parts of the façade, correspond to the same ratios that govern musical intervals” (Eco, 2004, 64). The same principles of harmony and proportion applied to all the arts, although there were differences in the way they were applied. The numerical ratios, however, were the same because mathematical values are immutable. For example, the Golden Section, considered to be the most aesthetically pleasing proportion, was often the basis of proportions in architecture and painting.  Even though they were concerned with form, it should be stressed that the medievals were not advocates of form over function. The purpose of the building or painting was the most important thing for an artisan to consider. The form was manipulated in such a way to fulfill the purpose of the work.

b. Light and Color

Medieval scientists, such as Robert Grosseteste, were interested in discovering the nature of light. Grosseteste’s treatise, On Light, blends Neoplatonist theories of emanation and aspects of Aristotle’s cosmology. The effects of light became more important to the medieval artisans, particularly in architecture, and they frequently associated light with their theories of color. Light and color affected the thoughts of medieval thinkers on certain characteristics of beauty, such as radiance and clarity.

One of the motivations for the medieval philosophers to pursue the notion of light developed from the belief that God is Light. Though Plotinus was not a Christian, the seeds of this idea that God is Light can be seen in his writings. “The simple beauty of a color is derived from a form that dominates the obscurity of matter and from the presence of an incorporeal light that is reason and idea” (Plotinus, I.6). The incorporeal light, for the Christians, is God’s light and gives splendor to the whole of creation. Light is what allows the beauty of objects, especially their color, to become illuminated, in order to display their beauty to the fullest. Pseudo-Dionysius follows up on these thoughts, “And what of the sun’s rays? Light comes from the Good, and light is an image of this archetypal Good. Thus the Good is also praised by the name ‘Light’, just as an archetype is revealed in its image” (Pseudo-Dionysius, 74). The light of the sun is a mere reflection and symbol of the divine light. The sun illuminates the universe, but the sun’s light is not used up. Light, for the medieval philosophers, is an important condition for there to be beauty.

Light illuminates the colors, which led the medieval thinkers to construct theories about color. Hugh of Saint Victor wrote, “With regard to the color of things there is no lengthy discussion, since sight itself demonstrates how much Beauty it adds to nature, when this last is adorned by many different colors” (quoted in Eco, 2004, 125). There is a sense in which color causes beauty, since everything has color. Hence, more radiant colors will cause the object to be more radiant and, therefore, more beautiful.

c. Symbolism

Symbolism was employed, first, as a tool to give meaning to artworks, and, second, it was used in a hermeneutical sense, to discover the deeper meaning of texts (especially the Bible). Medieval symbolism derives from a particular view of the world. Umberto Eco explains, “Firstly there was metaphysical symbolism, related to the philosophical habit of discerning the hand of God in the beauty of the world. Secondly there was universal allegory; that is, perceiving the world as a divine work of art, of such a kind that everything in it possesses moral, allegorical, and analogical meanings in addition to its literal meaning” (Eco, 1986, 56). The main idea is that the universe revealed God, its author or creator, through its beauty. As Pseudo-Dionysius wrote, “Any thinking person realizes that the appearances of beauty are signs of an invisible loveliness” (The Celestial Hierarchy, I.3). This belief was influenced by the Platonic notion that things on earth are shadows of things from the realm of Forms. Therefore, medieval artists wanted to construct their art in a symbolic manner, which would, likewise, help point to God.

Symbolism has connotations in the realm of hermeneutics, which is based on this notion that beauty in nature reflects God’s beauty. To put it differently, God revealed Himself to human beings through general revelation (nature) and special revelation (the Bible). For Aquinas, all knowledge about God begins in the material realm through the senses (ST I.88.3). People who did not have access to the Bible, because of cultural differences or illiteracy, could still receive God’s truth through nature, if they sought it. Therefore, medieval artists tried to create art for those who did not have literary access to the Bible by using symbols.

3. Individuals on Aesthetics

a. St. Augustine

Augustine set the stage for medieval Christian philosophers, drawing heavily from the Platonist and Neo-Platonist traditions. As a result, Platonic philosophy dominated the Christian medieval thought until Thomas Aquinas helped to popularize the writings of Aristotle. Augustine made a sharp distinction between the creation of God (ex nihilo) and the creation of artists (ex materia). Hence, God’s creation was not related to the notion of mimesis, which was perceived to be the goal of the arts. Even natural beauty, which was made by God, is like a shadow of God’s beauty, rather than fully actualized beauty. In a sense, God’s beauty emanates out to natural things through His act of creation. The framework for this idea had its source in Neoplatonic philosophers, particularly Plotinus. God created matter, which was initially formless, “without any beauty” (Augustine, Confessions, Bk. 12.3). The earth occupies the lowest form of beauty, and things become more beautiful as they possess more form, and less of the void. God is supremely beautiful, since only God possesses perfect form. Augustine, therefore, believes in a hierarchy of beautiful things, based on how much form they possess or lack.

Augustine developed ideas about rhythm that are pertinent to his aesthetic theory, especially the belief that rhythm originates with God. This idea of rhythm is expounded in Augustine’s De Musica. For Augustine, rhythm is immutable and eternal because its source is God. Augustine demonstrates this by pointing out that people can decide to begin pronounce a word in a differently, since pronunciation arises through convention. However, mathematical truths cannot be determined by convention; they have already been determined. They can only be discovered by human beings. Augustine then claims that rhythm is like math; it can only be discovered by people. Rhythm is already determined in God, and human beings cannot invent it. The way Augustine describes this process of discovery is reminiscent of, though not identical with, Plato’s theory of recollection. In other words, rhythm can be discovered through a questioner (or investigation), like Socrates’ questioning of the servant boy in the Meno.

Unity, equality, number, proportion, and order are the main elements in Augustine’s theory of beauty (Beardsley, 93ff.). Beardsley points out that Augustine does not systematically present these characteristics of beauty, but they can be found, often in relation to one another, throughout his writings. First, everything exists as a separate whole unit; therefore, each thing has unity. Simply put, something cannot have the potential to be beautiful, unless it exists. And if it has existence, it will also be a unified whole. Thus, unity is a necessary element of beauty. Further, the more unified something is the more beautiful it will be. Second, concerning equality (or likeness), Beardsley writes, “The existence of individual things as units, the possibility of repeating them and comparing groups of them with respect to equality or inequality, gives rise to proportion, measure, and number” (Beardsley, 94). Third, “Number, the base of rhythm, begins from unity” (De Musica, xvii. 56). Number, for Augustine, measures rhythm. Since rhythm is based on number, which Augustine believes is immutable, then it follows that rhythm is likewise immutable. Fourth, “in all the arts it is symmetry [or proportion] that gives pleasure, preserving unity and making the whole beautiful” (Of True Religion, xxx. 55). Fifth, Augustine asserts, “everything is beautiful that is in due order” (Of True Religion, xli. 77). Moreover, Augustine says, “Order is the distribution which allots things equal and unequal, each to its own place” (City of God, XIX, xiii). In other words, the degree to which things are in their proper place is the degree in which they are beautiful.

b. Pseudo-Dionysius

About the sixth century, the writings of the anonymous author Pseudo-Dionysius, emerged and influenced philosophers, most notably Thomas Aquinas. His main work that has relevance for aesthetics is The Divine Names, in which he refers to God as Beautiful. For Pseudo-Dionysius, “beautiful” refers to something that participates in beauty, while “beauty” refers to that ingredient that makes things beautiful. In the Cause (God), “beautiful” and “beauty” have no distinction because the Cause gathers everything back into Itself. The beautiful, which is God, is unchangeably beautiful; therefore, the beautiful cannot cease to be beautiful. This immutable beauty would have to truly exist, if the beautiful is the source of all beauty. Pseudo-Dionysius explains, “For beauty is the cause of harmony, of sympathy, of community. Beauty unites all things and is the source of all things” (Pseudo-Dionysius, 77). Further, he claims, “This – the One, the Good, the Beautiful – is in its uniqueness the Cause of the multitudes of the good and the beautiful” (Pseudo-Dionysius, 77).  Two main points can be taken from these statements. First, beauty is the cause of any beautiful thing that exists; and, second, the beautiful and the good are the same. Since beauty is the source of all things that exist, everything has a degree of beauty. Accordingly, everything has a desire and drive to move back toward the Beautiful and Good, that is, the source of the beauty of everything. This cyclical process is evident throughout Pseudo-Dionysius’ thought and illustrates Plotinus’ influence. It also prefigures Thomas’ belief that God is the source of all beauty, and the final end of human beings is the beatific vision, where people see God in His glory.

c. St. Thomas Aquinas

In terms of aesthetics, Thomas Aquinas focused his comments mostly on the notion of beauty. However, he did not say enough to have a detailed system; his views are extracted from what he did say. The discussion here will deal with his definition of beauty, the standards of beauty, and the question of whether beauty is a transcendental.

Thomas’ definition of beauty is as follows: beauty is that which gives pleasure when seen (ST I-II, 27. 1). This definition, at first glance, seems to suggest a subjective understanding of beauty for Thomas. The ambiguity comes from this word ‘seen,’ which has a different implication than it might seem in English. One might be tempted to equate seen with glance or notice; however, these possibilities are incomplete because they imply a passive account of seeing. The notion of ‘seen’ is more closely associated with the activity of contemplation. Jacques Maritain offers some helpful explanation,

Beauty is essentially the object of intelligence, for what knows in the full meaning of the word is the mind, which alone is open to the infinity of being. The natural site of beauty is the intelligible world: thence it descends. But it falls in a way within the grasp of the senses, since the senses in the case of man serve the mind and can themselves rejoice in knowing: ‘the beautiful relates only to sight and hearing of all senses, because these two are maxime cognoscitivi’(Maritain, 23).

Knowing beauty is not the result of a discursive process, nevertheless it is an activity of the mind. Knowledge in general, for Thomas, occurs when the form of an object, without its matter, exists in the mind of the knower (De Trinitate, q. 5, a. 2). For example, suppose someone is gazing at a flower. The same form, which is immaterial, of the flower in extra-mental reality is received by the senses and begins to exist in the mind of the knower. Then, the knower can contemplate the form of the object and discover its beauty. This process could transpire quickly. The knower (or beholder) receives data from the sensible world through the senses, but the senses do not recognize something as beautiful. The mind is responsible for recognizing the beauty of a given object. Consequently, knowledge has two aspects: passive and active. The passive aspect receives data from extra-mental reality; the active aspect gives the abstracted forms new existence in the mind of the knower. The details of this process are not relevant here; it is mainly important to see that the form of the object in reality begins to exist in the mind of the knower. Since beauty, for Thomas, is caused by the form of the object, then this process explains how the apprehension of beauty is the result of cognition.

More specifically, the senses of sight and hearing are those through which the beholder receives the form of the object. For Thomas, these senses are the most important ones for cognition; therefore, they are the ones employed in perceiving the beautiful. Thomas maintains the objectivity of beauty, in the sense that beauty resides in the object. In other words, beauty is not a concept in the mind of the beholder imposed onto a given object. If beauty is objective, then there must be some criteria by which we discover whether something is in fact beautiful.

The criteria of beauty are not precise formulae for discovering or labeling beautiful things with absolute certainty. These criteria are more like guideposts to help finite minds apprehend beauty. They do not have to all be present for an object to be considered beautiful, and the presence of one does not guarantee that the object is beautiful. For Thomas, beauty has four primary standards: actuality, proportion, radiance, and integrity (ST, I.39.8c). The original context of this list is centered on the relationship of the three persons of the trinity, specifically in reference to the Son. The Son has integrity insofar as he “has in Himself truly and perfectly the nature of the Father.” The Son has proportion “inasmuch as He is the express Image of the Father.” Lastly, the third property [radiance, brightness, or clarity] is found in the Son, as the Word, “which is the light and splendor of the intellect.” Since Thomas did not specifically expound on these properties in relationship to art, modern commentators and interpreters have tried to fill in this gap. Therefore, the exposition of the properties below comes largely from Armand Maurer, Umberto Eco, and Etienne Gilson.

Actuality. Actuality is not mentioned in Thomas’ list of the characteristics of beauty. However, for Thomas, everything has its ultimate source in actuality (or being); therefore, actuality (or being) is the basis of beauty. According to Maurer, actuality is used in three ways when referring to beauty: existence, form, and action (Maurer, 6ff.). Beauty is grounded in the actual existence of the object. For Thomas, everything that has being will also have a degree of beauty, regardless of how small that degree appears. In other words, an object must exist, in some sense, in order for it to be beautiful; otherwise, it would be nothing. Therefore, actuality is the ground of beauty. Maurer explains, “Whatever actuality a being has over and above its existence, it owes to its existence. For without existence there is no being; there is simply nothing. So the actuality of existence is the source and origin of the whole being, including its beauty” (Maurer, 7).

The second aspect of actuality is form. Form separates the existence of different things. For example, a dog and a tree both exist, but the dog exists as a dog and the tree exists as a tree. “As each thing has its own form, so it has its own distinctive beauty. In the words of St. Thomas, ‘Everything is beautiful in proportion to its own form’” (Maurer, 8). This interpretation of Thomas can be gleaned from his account of the relationship between goodness and form (ST I.5.5). To summarize this passage, everything is what it is because of its form; therefore, a thing has more goodness [and beauty] when it achieves a higher level of perfection in its form. A tree is beautiful to the degree in which it perfectly attains to the form of a tree and, likewise, a dog would be beautiful according to the form of a dog.

The third aspect of actuality is action. “Action completes the actuality of existence and form” (Maurer, 8). A clear illustration of the notion of action is a dancer. A dancer sitting and drinking coffee is still a dancer, in the sense that she possesses the skill required for dancing. Yet she is most completely a dancer when she performs the act of dancing. Strictly speaking, actuality is not a characteristic of beautiful things; more precisely, it is the necessary condition for grounding beauty in anything.

Proportion. Plotinus had already dismissed the notion of proportion (or symmetry or harmony) as the only qualification of beauty; however, the medieval philosophers still believed proportion had some importance for beauty. “We have only to think of the symmetry of the petals of an orchid, the balance of a mathematical equation, the mutual adaptation of the parts of a work of art, to realize how important the factor of harmony is in beauty” (Maurer, 10-11). The object may actually be symmetrical, but it is more important that it is well-balanced. The parts of the whole are in harmony with one another. Proportion is mentioned in this quote from Thomas’ Summa:

Proportion is twofold. In one sense it means a certain relation of one quantity to another, according as double, treble and equal are species of proportion. In another sense every relation of one thing to another is called proportion. And in this sense there can be a proportion of the creature to God, inasmuch as it is related to Him as the effect of its cause, and as potentiality to its act; and in this way the created intellect can be proportioned to know God (ST I.12.1).

Following Eco, proportion, according to this statement, could be reduced to relationships of quantity and relationships of quality (Eco, 1988, 82). Relationships of quantity are more mathematical, while those of quality are considered more ‘habitual’, which Eco explains as a relation of “mutual reference  or analogy, or some kind of agreement between them which subjects both to a common criterion or rule” (Eco, 1988, 82). This second relationship could be one of matter to form, cause to effect, and Creator to created (SCG II.16.8; II.80-81.7).

Radiance. “Radiance belongs to being considered precisely as beautiful: it is, in being, that which catches the eye, or the ear, or the mind, and makes us want to perceive it again” (Gilson, 2000, 35). Radiance is a bit more difficult to pinpoint than the other standards. Radiance signifies the luminosity that emanates from a beautiful object, which initially seizes the attention of the beholder. This trait is closely related to the medieval notions concerning light. For example, in terms of natural light, there is a sense in which the paintings in a gallery lose some of their beauty when the lights are turned off because they are no longer being perceived. However, Thomas also connects beautiful things with the divine light. “All form, through which things have being, is a certain participation in the divine clarity [or light]. And this is what [Dionysius] adds, that particulars are beautiful because of their own nature – that is, because of their form” (Thomas, Commentary on the Divine Names, IV.6). This quote provides another account of Thomas connecting all beauty to the beauty of God, as the cause of all beauty.

Wholeness. The last standard of beauty for Thomas is wholeness or integrity. “The first meaning of this term, for St. Thomas, is existential: it expresses the primal perfection of a thing, which is found in its existence (esse). In a second sense a thing is integral when it is perfect in its operation. Wholeness, in short, demands perfection in being and action” (Maurer, 29). If some particular thing was perfectly beautiful, then it would have to be completely actualized, lacking nothing essential to its nature. In other words, anything that is imperfect in some way is lacking some thing or ability necessary for its completion. Thomas speaks about wholeness [or integrity] in the context perfection: “The 'first' perfection is that according to which a thing is substantially perfect, and this perfection is the form of the whole; which form results from the whole having its parts complete” (ST I.73.1).

Whether or not beauty is a transcendental property of being will be the last topic in this entry. As a starting point, something is considered a transcendental if it “can be predicated of being as such and therefore of every being” (Koren, 48). The notion of transcendentals has its origins in Aristotle, specifically the Metaphysics. Aristotle claimed, as quoted earlier, that being and unity are implied in one another (Metaphysics, 1003b23). From this beginning, the medieval philosophers developed a broader notion of transcendentals; the three most mentioned transcendentals are one, true, and good. Aquinas' main presentation of the transcendentals is found in his Questiones Disputatae de Veritate, Question 1. In this text, Aquinas claims that being is the first thing conceived by the intellect because “every reality is essentially a being” (Disputed Questions on Truth, Q.1). Yet, Aquinas writes, “some predicates may be said to add to being inasmuch as they express a mode of being not expressed by the term being” (Disputed Questions on Truth, Q.1).

A predicate can add to being in two ways. First, the predicate may express a special mode of being. For example, in itself expresses a special mode of being, namely a substance, but it fails to be a transcendental because it does not apply to being as such. It applies only to individual beings. Second, a predicate may express a mode of being that is common to every being in general. This second mode can be understood in two ways: (1) absolutely – referring to a being as it relates to itself; (2) relatively – referring to a being as it relates to other beings.

A predicate can express being in reference to itself (or being-absolutely) either affirmatively or negatively. Affirmatively, Aquinas claims that the predicate thing is a transcendental, since each being is a unified whole. Negatively, Aquinas claims that the predicate one is a transcendental, since each being is undivided with reference to itself.

Moving to the predicates that express a relative mode of being, Aquinas claims that there are two ways. The first way refers to the idea that each being is separate from all other beings, so Aquinas refers to something (or otherness) as a transcendental property of being. The second way is based on the correspondence that one being has with another, which also has two facets. As a precondition, Aquinas writes, “This is possible only if there is something which is such that it agrees with every being. Such a being is the soul, which, as is said in The Soul, 'in some way is all things.' The soul, however, has both knowing and appetitive powers” (Disputed Questions on Truth, Q.1). In terms of the knowing power, true is a transcendental property because all knowing is an assimilation of the thing known by the knower. In terms of the appetitive power, good is a transcendental because the good is “that which all desire” (referring to Aristotle's Ethics).

To summarize, transcendentals are properties of being as such (that is, every being). Each transcendental is convertible with being. In other words, the transcendentals are present wherever being is present. However, just like being can be found in varying degrees, the transcendentals can also be found in degrees. For example, every being is not perfectly or completely good, but every being is good to a degree. So, Aquinas' list of transcendentals consists of the following: thing, one, something, true, and good. But is this list necessarily exhaustive? Could other things, such as beauty, be transcendentals?

Some interpreters of Aquinas' thought have claimed that beauty is not a transcendental; so, Aquinas left it off his list intentionally. Jan Aertsen, toward arguing that beauty is not a transcendental, attempts to clarify what it means for something to be a transcendental. He writes, “If the beautiful is a transcendental, then it must participate in the two features of transcendentals: because of their universal extension they are really identical, but they differ from one another conceptually” (Aertsen, 71). Aertsen concedes the first feature in reference to beauty; beauty is identical to the other transcendentals, particularly the good. However, he rejects the idea that beauty is conceptually different from the good, which, if correct, would prevent beauty from being counted among the transcendentals. Considering beauty as a kind of sub-category of the good is probably the main reason for rejecting it as a transcendental.

Contrary to Aertsen, Jacques Maritain (and others, like Etienne Gilson and Umberto Eco) maintains that beauty is a transcendental. The main problem with this view is that Aquinas did not include beauty in his list. Concerning this problem, an accepted explanation does not exist. Like Aertsen, Maritain claims that beauty is identical with the other transcendentals. But, contrary to Aertsen, Maritain asserts that Aquinas makes it clear that beauty and goodness are conceptually distinct. Specifically, Maritain refers to a passage in the Summa Theologia where Aquinas writes,

They [beauty and goodness] differ logically, for goodness properly relates to the appetite (goodness being what all things desire); and therefore it has the aspect of an end (the appetite being a kind of movement towards a thing). On the other hand, beauty relates to the cognitive faculty; for beautiful things are those which please when seen. Hence beauty consists in due proportion; for the senses delight in things duly proportioned, as in what is after their own kind-because even sense is a sort of reason, just as is every cognitive faculty. Now since knowledge is by assimilation, and similarity relates to form, beauty properly belongs to the nature of a formal cause (ST I.5.4).

Aquinas asserts in this passage that beauty and goodness differ logically. Maritain and others use this passage to show that Aquinas claimed that beauty and goodness were conceptually different, yet metaphysically identical. If Maritain, and others, are correct, then beauty could count as a transcendental property of being.

As this last section on transcendentals illustrates, while medieval philosophers did not develop a system of aesthetics they do provide an interesting entry point to the study of aesthetics . Ideas concerning the beautiful are spread throughout their writings,  gathered and developed by later philosophers.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Aristotle. The Complete Works of Aristotle. 2 Vols. Edited by Jonathan Barnes. Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Augustine. Of True Religion. Translated by J. H. S. Burleigh. Chicago:Henry Regnery Company, 1968.
  • Baird, Forrest E. and Walter Kaufmann. Medieval and Renaissance Philosophy. 5th ed. Upper Saddle River: Pearson Prentice Hall, 2008.
  • Hofstadter, Albert and Richard Kuhns, ed. Philosophies of Art and Beauty: Selected Readings in Aesthetics from Plato to Heidegger. The University of Chicago Press, 1964 (This book was primarily used for its selections from Augustine).
  • Plato. Complete Works. Edited by John M. Cooper. Indianapolis, Hackett Publishing Company, 1997.
  • Plotinus. The Enneads. Translated by Stephen MacKenna. Burdett: Larson Publications, 1992.
  • Pseudo-Dionysius. The Complete Works. Translated by Colm Luibheid. New York: Paulist Press, 1987.
  • Thomas Aquinas. Summa Theologiae (ST). Translated by Fathers of the English Dominican Province. Westminster: Christian Classics, 1981.
  • Thomas Aquinas. Summa Contra Gentiles (SCG). 5 Volumes. University of Notre Dame Press, 1975.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Aertsen, Jan A. “Beauty in the Middle Ages: A Forgotten Transcendental?” Medieval Philosophy and Theology. Vol. 1. (1991), 68-97.
  • Beardsley, Monroe. Aesthetics from Classical Greece to the Present: A Short History. Tuscaloosa: University of Alabama Press, 1966.
  • Coomaraswamy, Ananda K. Christian and Oriental Philosophy of Art. New York: Dover Publications, Inc., 1956.
  • Eco, Umberto. Art and Beauty in the Middle Ages. Translated by Hugh Bredin. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1986.
  • Eco, Umberto. The Aesthetics of Thomas Aquinas. Translated by Hugh Bredin. Harvard University Press, 1988.
  • Eco, Umberto. Ed. History of Beauty. Translated by Alastair McEwen. New York: Rizzoli, 2004.
  • Gilson, Etienne. The Arts of the Beautiful. Dalkey Archive Press, 2000.
  • Gilson, Etienne. Painting and Reality. New York: Pantheon Books, 1957.
  • Koren, Henry. An Introduction to the Science of Metaphysics. St. Louis: B. Herder Book Company, 1955.
  • Maritain, Jacques. Art and Scholasticism. Translated by J. F. Scanlan. New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1930.
  • Maurer, Armand. About Beauty: A Thomistic Interpretation. Houston: Center for Thomistic Studies, 1983.

Author Information

Michael Spicher
University of South Carolina
U. S. A.

The Paradox of Fiction

How is it that we can be moved by what we know does not exist, namely the situations of people in fictional stories? The so-called "paradox of emotional response to fiction" is an argument for the conclusion that our emotional response to fiction is irrational. The argument contains an inconsistent triad of premises, all of which seem initially plausible. These premises are (1) that in order for us to be moved (to tears, to anger, to horror) by what we come to learn about various people and situations, we must believe that the people and situations in question really exist or existed; (2) that such "existence beliefs" are lacking when we knowingly engage with fictional texts; and (3) that fictional characters and situations do in fact seem capable of moving us at times.

A number of conflicting solutions to this paradox have been proposed by philosophers of art. While some argue that our apparent emotional responses to fiction are only "make-believe" or pretend, others claim that existence beliefs aren't necessary for having emotional responses (at least to fiction) in the first place. And still others hold that there is nothing especially problematic about our emotional responses to works of fiction, since what these works manage to do (when successful) is create in us the "illusion" that the characters and situations depicted therein actually exist.

Table of Contents

  1. Radford's Initial Statement of the Paradox
  2. The Pretend Theory
  3. Objections to the Pretend Theory
    1. Disanalogies with Paradigmatic Cases of Make-Believe Games
    2. Problems with Quasi-Emotions
  4. The Thought Theory
  5. Objections to the Thought Theory
  6. The Illusion Theory
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Radford's Initial Statement of the Paradox

In a much-discussed 1975 article, and in a series of "Replies to my Critics" written over the next two decades, Colin Radford argues that our apparent ability to respond emotionally to fictional characters and events is "irrational, incoherent, and inconsistent" (p. 75). This on the grounds that (1) existence beliefs concerning the objects of our emotions (for example, that the characters in question really exist; that the events in question have really taken place) are necessary for us to be moved by them, and (2) that such beliefs are lacking when we knowingly partake of works of fiction. Taking it pretty much as a given that (3) such works do in fact move us at times, Radford's conclusion, refreshing in its humility, is that our capacity for emotional response to fiction is as irrational as it is familiar: "our being moved in certain ways by works of art, though very 'natural' to us and in that way only too intelligible, involves us in inconsistency and so incoherence" (p. 78).

The need for existence beliefs is supposedly revealed by the following sort of case. If what we at first believed was a true account of something heart-wrenching turned out to be false, a lie, a fiction, etc., and we are later made aware of this fact, then we would no longer feel the way we once did—though we might well feel something else, such as embarrassment for having been taken in to begin with. And so, Radford argues, "It would seem that I can only be moved by someone's plight if I believe that something terrible has happened to him. If I do not believe that he has not and is not suffering or whatever, I cannot grieve or be moved to tears" (p. 68). Of course, what Radford means to say here is: "I can only be rationally moved by someone's plight if I believe that something terrible has happened to him. If I do not believe that he has not and is not suffering or whatever, I cannot rationally grieve or be moved to tears." Such beliefs are absent when we knowingly engage with fictions, a claim Radford supports by presenting and then rejecting a number of objections that might be raised against it.

One of the major objections to his second premise considered by Radford is that, at least while we are engaged in the fiction, we somehow "forget" that what we are reading or watching isn't real; in other words, that we get sufficiently "caught up" in the novel, movie, etc. so as to temporarily lose our awareness of its fictional status. In response to this objection, Radford offers the following two considerations: first, if we truly forgot that what we are reading or watching isn't real, then we most likely would not feel any of the various forms of pleasure that frequently accompany other, more "negative" emotions (such as fear, sadness, and pity) in fictional but not real-life cases; and second, the fact that we do not "try to do something, or think that we should" (p. 71) when seeing a sympathetic character being attacked or killed in a film or play, implies our continued awareness of this character's fictional status even while we are moved by what happens to him. This second consideration—an emphasis on the behavioral disanalogies between our emotional responses to real-life and fictional characters and events—is one that crops up repeatedly in the arguments of philosophers such as Kendall Walton and Noel Carroll, whose positive accounts are nevertheless completely opposed to one another.

Finally, Radford thinks there can be no denying his third premise, that fictional characters themselves are capable of moving us—as opposed to, say, actual (or perhaps merely possible) people in similar situations, who have undergone trials and tribulations very much like those in the story. So his conclusion that our emotional responses to fiction are irrational appears valid and, however unsatisfactory, at the very least non-paradoxical. Summarizing his position in a 1977 follow-up article, with specific reference to the emotion of fear, Radford writes that existence beliefs "[are] a necessary condition of our being unpuzzlingly, rationally, or coherently frightened. I would say that our response to the appearance of the monster is a brute one that is at odds with and overrides our knowledge of what he is, and which in combination with our distancing knowledge that this is only a horror film, leads us to laugh—at the film, and at ourselves for being frightened" (p. 210).

Since the publication of Radford's original essay, many Anglo-American philosophers of art have been preoccupied with exposing the inadequacies of his position, and with presenting alternative, more "satisfying" solutions. In fact, few issues of The British Journal of Aesthetics, Philosophy, or The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism have come out over the past 25 years which fail to contain at least one piece devoted to the so-called "paradox of emotional response to fiction." As recently as April 2000, Richard Joyce writes in a journal article that "Radford must weary of defending his thesis that the emotional reactions we have towards fictional characters, events, and states of affairs are irrational. Yet, for all the discussion, the issue has not.been properly settled" (p. 209). It is interesting to note that while virtually all of those writing on this subject credit Radford with initiating the current debate, none of them have adopted his view as their own. At least in part, this must be because what Radford offers is less the solution to a mystery (how is it that we can be moved by what we know does not exist?) than a straightforward acceptance of something mysterious about human nature (our ability to be moved by what we know does not exist is illogical, irrational, even incoherent).

To date, three basic strategies for resolving the paradox in question have turned up again and again in the philosophical literature, each one appearing in a variety of different forms (though it should be noted, other, more idiosyncratic solutions can also be found). It is to these strategies, and some of the powerful criticisms that have been levied against them, that we now briefly turn.

2. The Pretend Theory

Pretend theorists, most notably Kendall Walton, in effect deny premise (3), arguing that it is not literally true that we fear horror film monsters or feel sad for the tragic heroes of Greek drama. As noted above, Walton's defense of premise (2) also rests on a playing up of the behavioral disanalogies between our responses to real-life versus fictional characters and events. But unlike Radford, who looks at real-life cases of emotional response and the likelihood of their elimination when background conditions change in order to defend premise (1), Walton offers nothing more than an appeal to "common sense": "It seems a principle of common sense, one which ought not to be abandoned if there is any reasonable alternative, that fear must be accompanied by, or must involve, a belief that one is in danger" (1978, pp. 6-7).

According to Walton, it is only "make-believedly" true that we fear horror film monsters, feel sad for the Greek tragic heroes, etc. He admits that these characters move us in various ways, both physically and psychologically—the similarities to real fear, sadness, etc. are striking—but regardless of what our bodies tell us, or what we might say, think, or believe we are feeling, what we actually experience in such cases are only "quasi-emotions" (e.g., "quasi-fear"). Quasi-emotions differ from true emotions primarily in that they are generated not by existence beliefs (such as the belief that the monster I am watching on screen really exists), but by "second-order" beliefs about what is fictionally the case according to the work in question (such as the belief that the monster I am watching on screen make-believedly exists. As Walton puts it, "Charles believes (he knows) that make-believedly the green slime [on the screen] is bearing down on him and he is in danger of being destroyed by it. His quasi-fear results from this belief" (p. 14). Thus, it is make-believedly the case that we respond emotionally to fictional characters and events due to the fact that our beliefs concerning the fictional properties of those characters and events generates in us the appropriate quasi-emotional states.

What has made the Pretend Theory in its various forms attractive to many philosophers is its apparent ability to handle a number of additional puzzles relating to audience engagement with fictions. Such puzzles include the following:

  • Why a reader or viewer of fictions who does not like happy endings can get so caught up in a particular story that, for example, he wants the heroine to be rescued despite his usual distaste for such a plot convention. Following Walton, there is no need to hypothesize conflicting desires on the part of the reader here, since "It is merely make-believe that the spectator sympathizes with the heroine and wants her to escape. .[H]e (really) wants it to be make-believe that she suffers a cruel end" (p. 25).
  • How fictional works—especially suspense stories—can withstand multiple readings or viewings without becoming less effective. According to Walton, this is possible because, on subsequent readings/viewings, we are simply playing a new game of pretend—albeit one with the same "props" as before: "The child hearing Jack and the Beanstalk knows that make-believedly Jack will escape, but make-believedly she does not know that he will. It is her make-believe uncertainty.not any actual uncertainty, that is responsible for the excitement and suspense that she feels" (p. 26).

3. Objections to the Pretend Theory

Despite its novelty, as well as Walton's heroic attempts at defending it, the Pretend Theory continues to come under attack from numerous quarters. Many of these attacks can be organized under the following two general headings:

a. Disanalogies with Paradigmatic Cases of Make-Believe Games

Walton introduces and supports his theory with reference to the familiar games of make-believe played by young children—games in which globs of mud are taken to be pies, for example, or games in which a father, pretending to be a vicious monster, will stalk his child and lunge at him at the crucial moment: "The child flees, screaming, to the next room. But he unhesitatingly comes back for more. He is perfectly aware that his father is only 'playing,' that the whole thing is 'just a game,' and that only make-believedly is there a vicious monster after him. He is not really afraid" (1978, p. 13). Such games rely on what Walton calls "constituent principles" (e.g., that whenever there is a glob of mud in a certain orange crate, it is make-believedly true that there is a pie in the oven) which are accepted or understood to be operating. However, these principles need not be explicit, deliberate, or even public: "one might set up one's own personal game, adopting principles that no one else recognizes. And at least some of the principles constituting a personal game of make-believe may be implicit" (p. 12). According to Walton, just as a child will experience quasi-fear as a result of believing that make-believedly a vicious monster is coming to get him, moviegoers watching a disgusting green slime make its way towards the camera will experience quasi-fear as a result of believing that, make-believedly, they are being threatened by a fearsome creature. In both cases, it is this quasi-fear which makes it the case that the respective game players are make-believedly (not really) afraid.

To the extent that one is able to identify significant disanalogies with familiar games of make-believe, then, Walton's theory looks to be in trouble. One such disanalogy concerns our relative lack of choice when it comes to (quasi-)emotional responses to fiction films and novels. Readers and viewers of such fictions, the argument goes, don't seem to have anything close to the ability of make-believe game-playing children to control their emotional responses. On the one hand, we can't just turn such responses off—refuse to play and prevent ourselves from being affected—like kids can. As Noel Carroll writes in his book, The Philosophy of Horror, "if it [the fear produced by horror films] were a pretend emotion, one would think that it could be engaged at will. I could elect to remain unmoved by The Exorcist; I could refuse to make believe I was horrified. But I don't think that that was really an option for those, like myself, who were overwhelmedly struck by it" (1990, p. 74).

On the other hand, Carroll also points out that as consumers of fiction we aren't able to just turn our emotional responses on, either: "if the response were really a matter of whether we opt to play the game, one would think that we could work ourselves into a make-believe dither voluntarily. But there are examples [of fictional works] which are pretty inept, and which do not seem to be recuperable by making believe that we are horrified. The monsters just aren't particularly horrifying, though they were intended to be" (p. 74). Carroll cites such forgettable pictures as The Brain from Planet Arous and Attack of the Fifty Foot Woman as evidence of his claim that some fictional texts simply fail to generate their intended emotional response.

Another proposed disanalogy between familiar examples of make-believe game-playing and our emotional engagement with fictions focuses on the phenomenology of the two cases. The objection here is that, assuming the accuracy of Walton's account when it comes to children playing make-believe, it is simply not true to ordinary experience that consumers of fictions are in similar emotional states when watching movies, reading books, and the like. David Novitz, for one, notes that "many theatre-goers and readers believe that they are actually upset, excited, amused, afraid, and even sexually aroused by the exploits of fictional characters. It seems altogether inappropriate in such cases to maintain that our theatre-goers merely make-believe that they are in these emotional states" (1987, p. 241). Glenn Hartz makes a similar point, in stronger language:

My teenage daughter convinces me to accompany her to a "tear-jerker" movie with a fictional script. I try to keep an open mind, but find it wholly lacking in artistry. I can't wait for it to end. Still, tears come welling up at the tragic climax, and, cursing, I brush them aside and hide in my hood on the way to the car. Phenomenologically, this description is perfectly apt. But it is completely inconsistent with the Make-Believe Theory, which says emotional flow is always causally dependent on make-believe. [H]ow can someone who forswears any imaginative involvement in a series of fictional events.respond to them with tears of sadness? (1999, p. 572)Carroll too argues that "Walton's theory appears to throw out the phenomenology of the state [here 'art-horror'] for the sake of logic" (1990, p. 74), on the grounds that, as opposed to children playing make-believe, when responding to works of fiction we do not seem to be aware at all of playing any such games.

Of course, Walton's position is that the only thing required here is the acceptance or recognition of a constituent principle underlying the game in question, and this acceptance may well be tacit rather than conscious. But Carroll thinks that it "strains credulity" to suppose that not only are we unaware of some of the rules of the game, but that "we are completely unaware of playing a game. Surely a game of make-believe requires the intention to pretend. But on the face of it, consumers of horror do not appear to have such an intention" (pp. 74-75). Although he disagrees with Walton's Pretend Theory on other grounds, Alex Neill offers a powerful reply to objections which cite phenomenological disanalogies. In his words, what philosophers such as Novitz, Hartz, and Carroll miss "is that the fact that Charles is genuinely moved by the horror precisely what motivates Walton's account":

By labeling this kind of state 'quasi-fear,' Walton is not suggesting that it consists of feigned or pretended, rather than actual, feelings and sensations. .Rather, Walton label's Charles's physiological/psychological state 'quasi-fear' to mark the fact that what his feelings and sensations are feelings and sensations of is precisely what is at issue. .On his view, we can actually be moved by works of fiction, but it is make-believe that we are moved to is fear. (1991, pp. 49-50)Suffice to say, the question whether objections to Walton's Pretend Theory on the grounds of phenomenological difference are valid or not continues to be discussed and debated.

b. Problems with Quasi-Emotions

In arguing that Walton's quasi-emotions are unnecessary theoretical entities, some philosophers have pointed to cases of involuntary reaction to visual stimuli—the so-called "startle effect" in film studies terminology—where the felt anxiety, repulsion, or disgust is clearly not make-believe, since these reactions do not depend at all on beliefs in the existence of what we are seeing. Simo Säätelä for example, argues that "fear is easy to confuse with being shocked, startled, anxious, etc. Here the existence or non-existence of the object can hardly be important. When we consider fear [in fictional contexts] this often seems to be a plausible analysis—it is simply a question of a mistaken identification of sensations and feelings. Thus no technical redescription in terms of make-believe is needed" (1994, p. 29). One problem with turning this objection into a full-blown theory of emotional response to fiction in its own right, as both S„„tel„ and Neill have suggested doing, is that there seem to be at least some cases of fearing fictions where the startle effect is not involved. Another problem is that it is not at all clear what equivalents to the startle effect are available in the case of emotions such as, say, pity and regret.

A similar objection to Walton's quasi-emotional states has been put forward by Glenn Hartz. He argues not that our responses to fiction are independent of belief, to be understood on the model of the startle effect, but that they are pre-conscious: that real (as opposed to pretend) beliefs which are not consciously entertained are automatically generated by certain visual stimuli. These beliefs are inconsistent with what the spectator—fully aware of where he is and what he is doing—explicitly avows. As Hartz puts it, "how could anything as cerebral and out-of-the-loop as 'make believe' make adrenaline and cortisol flow?" (1999, p. 563).

4. The Thought Theory

Thought theories boldly deny premise (1), the old and established thesis, traceable as far back as Aristotle and central to the so-called "Cognitive Theory of emotions," (see Theories of Emotion) that existence beliefs are a necessary condition of (at the very least rational) emotional response. At the heart of the Thought Theory lies the view that, although our emotional responses to actual characters and events may require beliefs in their existence, there is no good reason to hold up this particular type of emotional response as the model for understanding emotional response in general. What makes emotional response to fiction different from emotional response to real world characters and events is that, rather than having to believe in the actual existence of the entity or event in question, all we need do is "mentally represent" (Peter Lamarque), "entertain in thought" (Noel Carroll), or "imaginatively propose" (Murray Smith) it to ourselves. By highlighting our apparent capacity to respond emotionally to fiction—by treating this as a central case of emotional response in general—the thought theorist believes he has produced hard evidence in support of the claim that premise (1) stands in need of modification, perhaps even elimination.

Even before the first explicit statement of the Thought Theory in a 1981 article by Lamarque, a number of philosophers rejected existence beliefs as a requirement for emotional response to fictions. Instead, they argued that the only type of beliefs necessary when engaging with fictions are "evaluative" beliefs about the characters and events depicted; beliefs, for example, about whether the characters and events in question have characteristics which render them funny, frightening, pitiable, etc. Eva Schaper, for example, in an article published three years before Lamarque's, writes that:

We need a distinction.between the kind of beliefs which are entailed by my knowing that I am dealing with fiction, and the kind of beliefs which are relevant to my being moved by what goes on in fiction. .[B]eliefs about characters and events in fiction.are alone involved in our emotional response to what goes on. (1978, p. 39, 44)

More recently, but again without reference to the Thought Theory, R.T. Allen argues that, "A not a presentation of facts. But true statements can be made about what happens in it and beliefs directed towards those events can be true or false. .Once we realize that truth is not confined to the factual, the problem disappears" (1986, p. 66).

Although the two are closely related, strictly-speaking this version of the Thought Theory should not be confused with what is often referred to as the "Counterpart Theory" of emotional response to fiction. As Gregory Currie explains, according to this latter theory, "we experience genuine emotions when we encounter fiction, but their relation to the story is causal rather than intentional; the story provokes thoughts about real people and situations, and these are the intentional objects of our emotions" (1990, p. 188). Walton himself provides an early statement of the Counterpart Theory: "If Charles is a child, the movie may make him wonder whether there might not be real slimes or other exotic horrors like the one depicted in the movie, even if he fully realizes that the movie-slime itself is not real. Charles may well fear these suspected dangers; he might have nightmares about them for days afterwards" (1978, p. 10). Some variations of this theory go so far as make their claims with reference to possible as opposed to real people and situations. Regardless, it is important to note that Counterpart theories have at least as much in common with Pretend theories as with Thought theories, since, like the former, they seem to require a modification of Radford's third premise (it is not the fictional works themselves that move us, but their real or possible counterparts).

5. Objections to the Thought Theory

Somewhat surprisingly, the Thought Theory has generated relatively little critical discussion, a fact in virtue of which it can be said to occupy a privileged position today. In a 1982 article, however, Radford himself attacks it on the following grounds:

Lamarque claims that I am frightened by 'the thought' of the green slime. That is the 'real object' of my fear. But if it is the moving picture of the slime which frightens me (for myself), then my fear is irrational, etc., for I know that what frightens me cannot harm me. So the fact that we are frightened by fictional thoughts does not solve the problem but forms part of it. (pp. 261-62]

More recently, film-philosopher Malcolm Turvey criticizes the Thought Theory on the grounds that it appears to ignore the concrete nature of the moving image, instead hypothesizing a "mental entity as the primary causal agent of the spectator's emotional response" (1997, p. 433). According to Turvey, because we can and frequently do respond to the concrete presentation of cinematic images in a manner that is indifferent to their actual existence in the world, and because there is nothing especially mysterious about this fact, no theory at all is needed to solve the problem of emotional response to fiction film.

Even if it is correct with respect to the medium of film, however, what we might call Turvey's "concreteness consideration" does not stand up as a critique of the Thought Theory generally. In the case of literature, for example, the reader obviously does not respond emotionally to the words as they appear on the printed page, but rather to the mental images these words serve to conjure in his mind.

It is also debatable whether the Thought Theory cannot be revised so as to incorporate the concreteness consideration, by simply redefining the psychological attitude referred to by Carroll as "entertaining" in either neutral or negative terms. In order for us to be moved by a work of fiction, the revised theory would go, all we need do is adopt a nonassertive—though still evaluative—psychological attitude towards the images which appear before us on screen (while watching a film) or in our minds (when thinking about them later, or perhaps while reading about them in a book). Turvey himself makes a move in this direction when he writes that "the spectator's capacity to 'entertain' a cinematic representation of a fictional referent does not require the postulation of an intermediate, mental entity such as a 'thought' or 'imagination' in order to be understood" (1997, p. 456).

Arguing on behalf of the Thought Theory, Murray Smith invites us to "imagine gripping the blade of a sharp knife and then having it pulled from your grip, slicing through the flesh of your hand. If you shuddered in reaction to the idea, you didn't do so because you believed that your hand was being cut by a knife" (1995, p. 116). In part due to its intuitive plausibility, in part due to its ability to explain away certain behavioral disanalogies with real-life cases of emotional response (for example: although he frightens us, the reason we don't run out of the theater when watching the masked killer head towards us on the movie screen is because we never stop believing for a moment that what we are watching is only a representation of someone who doesn't really exist), few philosophers have sought to meet the challenge posed by the Thought Theory head on.

Perhaps the biggest problem for the Thought Theory lies in its difficulty justifying its own presuppositions. In his original article, Radford asks the following questions in order to highlight the mysterious nature of our emotional responses to fiction: "We are saddened, but how can we be? What are we sad about? How can we feel genuinely and involuntarily sad, and weep, as we do knowing as we do that no one has suffered or died?" (1977, p. 77). These are questions the Thought theorist will have a tough time answering to the satisfaction of anyone not already inclined to agree with him. That is to say, where the Thought theorist seems to run into trouble is in explaining just why it is the mere entertaining in thought of a fictional character or event is able to generate emotional responses in audiences.

6. The Illusion Theory

Illusion theorists, of whom there seem to be fewer and fewer these days, deny Radford's second premise. They suggest a mechanism—whether it be some loose concept of "weak" or "partial" belief, Samuel Taylor Coleridge's famous "willing suspension of disbelief," Freud's notion of "disavowal" as adapted by psychoanalytic film theorists such as Christian Metz, or something else entirely—whereby existence beliefs are generated in the course of our engagement with works of fiction.

In Section 1, we came across one of the most powerful objections to have been levied against the Illusion Theory to date: the obvious behavioral disanalogies between our emotional responses to real-life versus fictional characters and events. Even when the existence beliefs posited by the Illusion theorist are of the weak or partial variety, Walton argues that

Charles has no doubts about the whether he is in the presence of an actual slime. If he half believed, and were half afraid, we would expect him to have some inclination to act on his fear in the normal ways. Even a hesitant belief, a mere suspicion, that the slime is real would induce any normal person seriously to consider calling the police and warning his family. Charles gives no thought whatever to such courses of action. (1978, p. 7)The force of this and related objections has led to a state of affairs in which Gregory Currie, in a lengthy essay on the paradox of emotional response to fiction, can devote all of two sentences to his dismissal of the Illusion Theory:

Hardly anyone ever literally believes the content of a fiction when he knows it to be a fiction; if it happens at moments of forgetfulness or intense realism in the story (which I doubt), such moments are too brief to underwrite our often sustained responses to fictional events and characters. Henceforth, I shall assume the truth of [Radford's second premise] and consider the [other] possibilities. (1990, pp. 188-89)Notice, however, that a tremendous amount of weight seems to be placed here on the word "literally." Is it really true to the facts that when normal people—not philosophers or film theorists!—talk about the "believability" of certain books they have read and movies they have seen, the notions of belief and believable-ness they have in mind are metaphorical, or else simply confused or mistaken? And that everyday talk of being "absorbed by" fictions, "engaged in" them, "lost" in them, etc. can be explained away solely in terms of such non-belief dependent features of the fictions in question as their "vividness" and "immediacy"?

It certainly isn't clear whether the Illusion Theory in any form can be salvaged as a possible solution to the paradox of emotional response to fiction. It isn't even clear whether what we have here really qualifies as a "paradox" at all. As Richard Moran (1994) argues, with reference to what he takes to be non-problematic cases of emotional response to modal facts (things that might have happened to us but didn't) and historical facts (things that happened to us in the past): "our paradigms of ordinary emotions exhibit a great deal of variety., and.the case of fictional emotions gains a misleading appearance of paradox from an inadequate survey of examples"(p. 79). What is clear, however, is that the various debates surrounding the topic of emotional response to fiction continue to rage in the philosophical literature.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Allen, R.T. (1986) "The Reality of Responses to Fiction." British Journal of Aesthetics 26.1, pp. 64-68.
  • Carroll, N. (1990) The Philosophy of Horror; or, Paradoxes of the Heart. New York, Routledge.
  • Currie, G. (1990) The Nature of Fiction. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
  • Hartz, G. (1999) "How We Can Be Moved by Anna Karenina, Green Slime, and a Red Pony." Philosophy 74, pp. 557-78.
  • Joyce, R. (2000) "Rational Fear of Monsters." British Journal of Aesthetics 40.2, pp. 209-224.
  • Lamarque, P. (1981) "How Can We Fear and Pity Fictions?" British Journal of Aesthetics 21.4, pp. 291-304.
  • Moran, R. (1994) "The Expression of Feeling in Imagination." Philosophical Review 103.1, pp. 75-106.
  • Neill, A. (1991) "Fear, Fiction and Make-Believe." Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 49.1, pp. 47-56.
  • Novitz, D. (1987) Knowledge, Fiction and Imagination. Philadelphia, Temple University Press.
  • Radford, C. (1975) "How Can We Be Moved by the Fate of Anna Karenina?" Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplemental Vol. 49, pp. 67-80.
  • Radford, C. (1977) "Tears and Fiction." Philosophy 52, pp. 208-213.
  • Säätelä, S. (1994) "Fiction, Make-Believe and Quasi Emotions." British Journal of Aesthetics 34, pp. 25-34.
  • Schaper, E. (1978) "Fiction and the Suspension of Disbelief." British Journal of Aesthetics 18, pp. 31-44.
  • Smith, M. (1995) "Film Spectatorship and the Institution of Fiction." Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 53.2, pp. 113-27.
  • Turvey, M. (1997) "Seeing Theory: On Perception and Emotional Response in Current Film Theory." Film Theory and Philosophy, R. Allen and M. Smith (Eds.). Oxford, Oxford University Press, pp. 431-57.
  • Walton, K. (1978) "Fearing Fictions." Journal of Philosophy 75.1, pp. 5-27.

Author Information

Steven Schneider
Harvard University
U. S. A.


The philosophical study of humor has been focused on the development of a satisfactory definition of humor, which until recently has been treated as roughly co-extensive with laughter. The main task is to develop an adequate theory of just what humor is.

According to the standard analysis, humor theories can be classified into three neatly identifiable groups:incongruity, superiority, and relief theories. Incongruity theory is the leading approach and includes historical figures such as Immanuel Kant, Søren Kierkegaard, and perhaps has its origins in comments made by Aristotle in the Rhetoric. Primarily focusing on the object of humor, this school sees humor as a response to an incongruity, a term broadly used to include ambiguity, logical impossibility, irrelevance, and inappropriateness. The paradigmatic Superiority theorist is Thomas Hobbes, who said that humor arises from a "sudden glory" felt when we recognize our supremacy over others. Plato and Aristotle are generally considered superiority theorists, who emphasize the aggressive feelings that fuel humor. The third group, Relief theory, is typically associated with Sigmund Freud and Herbert Spencer, who saw humor as fundamentally a way to release or save energy generated by repression. In addition, this article will explore a fourth group of theories of humor: play theory. Play theorists are not so much listing necessary conditions for something's counting as humor, as they are asking us to look at humor as an extension of animal play.

While the task of defining humor is a seemingly simple one, it has proven quite difficult. Each theory attempts to provide a characterization of what is at least at the core of humor. However, these theories are not necessarily competing; they may be seen as simply focusing on different aspects of humor, treating certain aspects as more fundamental than others.

Table of Contents

  1. What Is Humor?
    1. Humor, Laughter, and the Holy Grail
    2. Problems Classifying Theorists
  2. Theories of Humor
    1. Superiority Theory
    2. Relief Theory
    3. Incongruity Theory
    4. Play Theory
    5. Summary of Humor Theories
  3. Reference and Further Reading

1. What is Humor?

Almost every major figure in the history of philosophy has proposed a theory, but after 2500 years of discussion there has been little consensus about what constitutes humor. Despite the number of thinkers who have participated in the debate, the topic of humor is currently understudied in the discipline of philosophy. There are only a few philosophers currently focused on humor-related research, which is most likely due to two factors: the problems in the field have proved incredibly difficult, inviting repeated failures, and the subject is erroneously dismissed as an insignificant concern. Nevertheless, scope and significance of the study of humor is reflected in the interdisciplinary nature of the filed, which draws insights from philosophy, psychology, sociology, anthropology, film, and literature. It is rare to find a philosophical topic that bares such direct relevance to our daily lives, our social interactions, and our nature as humans.

a. Humor, Laughter, Comedy, and the Holy Grail

The majority of the work on humor has been occupied with the following foundational question: What is humor? The word "humor" itself is of relatively recent origin. According to the Oxford English Dictionary, it arose during the 17th century out of psycho-physiological scientific speculation on the effects of various humors that might affect a person's temperament. Much of the earlier humor research is riddled with equivocations between humor and laughter, and the problem continues into recent discussions. John Dewey states one reason to make the distinction: "The laugh is by no means to be viewed from the standpoint of humor; its connection with humor is only secondary. It marks the ending [. . .] of a period of suspense, or expectation, all ending which is sharp and secondary" (John Dewey, 558). We laugh for a variety of reasons—hearing a funny joke, inhaling laughing gas, being tickled—not all of which result from what we think of as humor. Attempting to offer a general theory of laughter and humor, John Morreall (manuscript) makes a finer distinction: laughter results from a pleasant psychological shift, whereas, humor arises from a pleasant cognitive shift. Noting the predominance of non-humorous laughter, researcher Robert Provine (2000) argues that laughter is most often found in non-humorous social interactions, deployed as some sort of tension relief mechanism. If humor is not a necessary condition of laughter, then we might ask if it is sufficient. Often humor will produce laughter, but sometimes it results in only a smile. Obviously, these relatively distinct phenomena are intimately connected in some manner, but to understand the relationship we need clearer notions of both laugher and humor.

Laughter is a fairly well described physiological process that results in a limited range of characteristic vocal patterns that are only physiologically possible, as Provine suggests, for bi-pedal creatures with breath control. If we describe humorous laughter as laughter in response to humor, then we must answer the question, What is humor? This topic will be explored in the next few sections, but for starters, we can say that humor or amusement is widely regarded as a response to a certain kind of stimulus. The comic, on the other hand, is best described as a professionally produced source of humor, a generic element of various artforms. In distinguishing between humorous and non-humorous laughter we presuppose a working definition of humor, based partly on the character of our response and partly on the properties of humorous objects. This is not necessarily to beg the question about what is humor, but to enter into the real world process of correctively developing a definition. The first goal of a humor theory is to look for the basis of our practical ability to identify humor.

Most definitions of humor are essentialist in that they try to list the necessary and sufficient conditions something must meet in order to be counted as humor. Some theories isolate a common element supposedly found in all humor, but hold back from making claims about the sufficient conditions. Many theorists seem to confuse offering the necessary conditions for a response to count as humor with explaining why we find one thing funny rather than another. This second question, what would be sufficient for an object to be found funny, is the Holy Grail of humor studies, and must be kept distinct from the goals of a definition of the humor response. The Holy Grail is often confused with a question regarding the sufficient conditions for our response to count as humorous amusement, but a crucial distinction needs to be made: identifying the conditions of a response is different from the isolating the features something must possess in order to provoke such a response. The first task is much different from suggesting what features are sufficient to provoke a response of humorous amusement. What amounts to a humor response is different from what makes something humorous. The noun (humor) and adjectival (humorous) senses of the term are difficult to keep distinct due to the imprecision of our language in this area. Much of the dissatisfaction with traditional humor theories can be traced back to an equivocation between these two senses of the term.

b. Problems Classifying Theorists

The standard analysis, developed by D. H. Monro, that classifies humor theories into superiority, incongruity, and relief theories sets up a false expectation of genuine competition between the views. Rarely do any of the historical theorists in any of these schools state their theories as listing necessary of sufficient conditions for something to count as humor, much less put their views in competition with others. A further problem concerns just what the something is that might be called humor. Some theories address the object of humor, whereas others are concerned primarily with the characteristics of the response, and other theories discuss both.

The popular reduction of humor theories into three groups—Incongruity, Relief, and Superiority theories—is an over simplification. Several scholars have identified over 100 types of humor theories, and Patricia Keith-Spiegel's classification of humor theories into 8 major types (biological, superiority, incongruity, surprise, ambivalence, release, configuration, and psychoanalytic theories) has been fairly influential. Jim Lyttle suggests that, based on the question they are primarily addressing humor, theories can be classified into 3 different groups. He argues that, depending on their focus, humor theories can be grouped under these categories: functional, stimuli, and response theories. (1) Functional theories of humor ask what purpose humor has in human life. (2) Stimuli theories ask what makes a particular thing funny. (3)Response theorists ask why we find things funny. A better way to phrase this concern is to say that response theorists ask what is particular about feelings of humor.

A little probing shows that Lyttle's grouping is strained, since many of the humor theories address more than one of these questions, and an answer to one often involves an answer to the other questions. For instance, though focused on the function of humor, relief theories often have something to say about all three questions: humor serves as a tension release mechanism, the content often concerns the subject of repressed desires, and finding these funny involves a feeling of relief.

Regardless of the classificatory scheme, when analyzing the tradition of humor theories we need to consider how each of the traditionally defined schools answers the major questions that occupy the bulk of the discussion. The primary questions of humor theory include:

1. Humor question: What is humor?

(An answer to this question often entails answers to questions regarding the object and the response. This is the central question of any humor theory.)

2. Object Feature Questions:

  1. Are there any features frequently found in what is found funny?
  2. Are there any features necessary for something to have in order to be found funny?
  3. Are there any features that by themselves or considered jointly are sufficient for something to be found funny? (Answering this question affirmatively would amount to discovering the holy grail of humor theory.)

3. Response Question: Is there anything psychologically or cognitively distinctive or characteristic about finding something funny?

4. Laughter Question: How is humor related to laughter?

Given this list, we may ask what would a theory of humor amount to? To count as a humor theory and not just an approach to humor, a theory must attempt an answer to Question 1—What is humor? Like the relief theories, most humor theorists do not attempt to answer this question head on, but discuss some important or necessary characteristics of humor. Since the various theories of humor are addressing different sets of questions within this cluster as well as related question in the general study of humor, it is often difficult to put them in competition with each other. Accepting this limitation, we can proceed to explore a few of the major humor theories listed in the widely influential standard analysis.

2. Theories of Humor

a. Superiority Theory

We can give two forms to the claims of the superiority theory of humor: (1) the strong claim holds that all humor involves a feeling of superiority, and (2) the weak claim suggests that feelings of superiority are frequently found in many cases of humor. It is not clear that many superiority theorists would hold to the strong claim if pressed, but we will evaluate as a necessary condition nonetheless.

Neither Plato nor Aristotle makes clear pronouncements about the essence of humor, though their comments are preoccupied with the role of feelings of superiority in our finding something funny. In the "Philebus," Plato tries to expose the "mixture of pleasure and pain that lies in the malice of amusement." He argues that ignorance is a misfortune that when found in the weak is considered ridiculous. In comedy, we take malicious pleasure from the ridiculous, mixing pleasure with a pain of the soul. Some of Aristotle's brief comments in the Poetics corroborate Plato's view of the pleasure had from comedy. Tragedy deals with subjects who are average or better than average; however, in comedy we look down upon the characters, since it presents subjects of lesser virtue than, or "who are inferior to," the audience. The "ludicrous," according to Aristotle, is "that is a failing or a piece of ugliness which causes no pain of destruction" (Poetics, sections 3 and 7). Going beyond the subject of comedy, in the Rhetoric (II, 12) Aristotle defines wit as "educated insolence," and in the Nicomachean Ethics (IV, 8) he describes jokes as "a kind of abuse" which should ideally be told without producing pain. Rather than clearly offering a superiority theory of humor, Plato and Aristotle focus on this common comic feature, bringing it to our attention for ethical considerations.

Thomas Hobbes developed the most well known version of the Superiority theory. Giving emphatic expression to the idea, Hobbes says "that the passion of laughter is nothing else but sudden glory arising from some sudden conception of some eminency in ourselves, by comparison with the infirmity of others, or with our own formerly" (Human Nature, ch. 8). Motivated by the literary conceit of the laugh of triumph, Hobbes's expression the superiority theory looks like more of a theory of laughter than a theory of humor. Charles Baudelaire (1956) offers an interesting variation on Hobbes' superiority theory, mixing it with mortal inferiority. He argues that that "laughter is satanic"—an expression of dominance over animals and a frustrated complaint against our being merely mortal.

Critically reversing the superiority theory, Robert Solomon (2002) offers an inferiority theory of humor. He thinks that self-recognition in the silly antics and self-deprecating behavior of the Three Stooges is characteristic of a source of humor based in inferiority or modesty. Rather than comparing our current with our former inferior selves, Solomon sees the ability to not take yourself seriously, or to see yourself as less than ideal, as a source of virtuous modesty and compassion. Solomon's analysis of the Three Stooges is not a full-blown theory of humor, in that it does not make any pronouncements about the necessary or sufficient conditions of humor; however, it is a theory of humor in the sense that it suggests a possible source of humor or what humor can be and how it might function.

Solomon's inferiority theory of humor raises a central objection against the Superiority theory, namely, that a feeling of superiority is not a necessary condition of humor. Morreall offers several examples, such as finding a bowling ball in his refrigerator, that could be found funny, but do not clearly involve superiority. If feelings of superiority are not necessary for humor, are they sufficient? Undoubtedly, this is not the case. As an 18th century critic of Hobbes, Francis Hutcheson, points out, we can feel superior to lots of things, dogs, cats, trees, etc, without being amused: "some ingenuity in dogs and monkeys, which comes near to some of our own arts, very often makes us merry; whereas their duller actions, in which the are much below us, are no matter of jest at all" (p. 29). However, if we evaluate the weaker version of the superiority theory—that humor is often fueled by feelings of superiority—then we have a fairly well supported empirical claim, easily confirmable by first hand observation.

b. Relief Theory

Relief theories attempt to describe humor along the lines of a tension-release model. Rather than defining humor, they discuss the essential structures and psychological processes that produce laughter. The two most prominent relief theorists are Herbert Spencer and Sigmund Freud. We can consider two version of the relief theory: (1) the strong version holds that all laughter results from a release of excessive energy; (2) the weak version claims that it is often the case that humorous laughter involves a release of tension or energy. Freud develops a more specific description of the energy transfer mechanism, but the process he describes is not essential to the basic claims of the relief theory of humor.

In "The Physiology of Laughter" (1860), Spencer develops a theory of laughter that is intimately related to his "hydraulic" theory of nervous energy, whereby excitement and mental agitation produces energy that "must expend itself in some way or another." He argues that "nervous excitation always tends to beget muscular motion." As a form of physical movement, laughter can serve as the expressive route of various forms of nervous energy. Spencer did not see his theory as a competitor to the incongruity theory of humor; rather, he tried to explain why it is that a certain mental agitation arising from a "descending incongruity" results in this characteristically purposeless physical movement. Spencer never satisfactorily answers this specific question, but he presents the basic idea that laughter serves to release pent up energy.

One criticism of Spencer's theory of energy relief is that it does not seem to describe most cases of humor that occur quickly. Many instances of jokes, witticisms, and cartoons do not seem to involve a build up of energy that is then released. Perhaps Spencer thinks that the best explanation for laughter, an otherwise purposeless expenditure of energy, must be that it relieves energy produced from humor. However, since most of our experiences of humor do not seem to involve an energy build up, and humor does not seem forthcoming when we are generally agitated, a better explanation might be that laughter is not as purposeless as it seems or that all expenditures of energy, purposeful or not, need involve a build up.

Spencer might reply that everyone is continuously building up energy simply through the process of managing everyday stress. As such, most people have excess energy, a form of energy potential, waiting to be released by humor. For example, one often hears it said that humor allows one to "blow off steam" after a stressful day at work. The problem with this line of argument is that those who are most "stressed out" seem the least receptive to humor. Not only do attempts at humor frequently fall flat on the hurried, the amusement that results is typically minimal. Perhaps Spencer could argue that at a certain threshold the pent up energy jams the gates such that humor is unable to provide a release. This line of defense might be plausible, but the tension release theory starts to look a bit ad hoc when you have to posit things such as jammed energy release gates and the like.

In Jokes and Their Relation to the Unconscious (1905), Freud develops a more fine grained version of the relief theory of laughter, that amounts to a restatement of Spencer's theory with the addition of a new process. He describes three different sources of laughter—joking, the comic, and humor—which all involve the saving of some psychic energy that is then discharged through laughter. In joking, the energy that would have been used to repress sexual and hostile feelings is saved and can be released in laughter. In the comic, cognitive energy to be used to solve an intellectual challenge is left over and can be released. The humorous involves a saving of emotional energy, since what might have been an emotion provoking situation turns out to be something we should treat non-seriously. The energy building up for the serious emotional reaction can then be released.

The details of Freud's discussions of the process of energy saving, are widely regarded as problematic. His notion of energy saving is unclear, since it is not clear what sense it makes to say that energy which is never called upon is saved, rather than saying that no energy was expended. Take his theory of jokes, where the energy that otherwise would have been used to repress a desire is saved by joking which allows for aggression to be released. John Morreall and Noel Carroll make a similar criticism of this theory of energy management. We may have an idea of what it is like to express pent up energy, but we have no notion of what it would be to release energy that is used to repress a desire. Beyond the claim of queerness, this theory of joking does not result in the expected empirical observations. On Freud's explanation, the most inhibited and repressed people would seem to enjoy joking the most, though the opposite is the case.

Relief theories of laughter do not furnish us a way to distinguish humorous from non-humorous laughter. Freud's saved energy is perceptually indistinguishable with other forms of energy. As we saw with Spencer, Relief theories must be saddled to another theory of humor. Freud's attempt to explain why we laugh is also an effort to explain why we find certain tendentious jokes especially funny, though it is not clear what he is getting at in his account of the saving of energy. He commits the fundamental mistake of relief theorists—they erroneously assume that since mental energy often finds release in physical movement, any physical movement must be explainable by an excess of nervous energy.

c. Incongruity Theory

The incongruity theory is the reigning theory of humor, since it seems to account for most cases of perceived funniness, which is partly because "incongruity" is something of an umbrella term. Most developments of the incongruity theory only try to list a necessary condition for humor—the perception of an incongruity—and they stop short of offering the sufficient conditions.

In the Rhetoric (III, 2), Aristotle presents the earliest glimmer of an incongruity theory of humor, finding that the best way to get an audience to laugh is to setup an expectation and deliver something "that gives a twist." After discussing the power of metaphors to produce a surprise in the hearer, Aristotle says that "[t]he effect is produced even by jokes depending upon changes of the letters of a word; this too is a surprise. You find this in verse as well as in prose. The word which comes is not what the hearer imagined." These remarks sound like a surprise theory of humor, similar to that later offered by René Descartes, but Aristotle continues to explain how the surprise must somehow "fit the facts," or as we might put it today, the incongruity must be capable of a resolution.

In the Critique of Judgment, Immanuel Kant gives a clearer statement of the role of incongruity in humor: "In everything that is to excite a lively laugh there must be something absurd (in which the understanding, therefore, can find no satisfaction). Laughter is an affection arising from the sudden transformation of a strained expectation into nothing" (I, I, 54).

Arthur Schopenhauer offers a more specific version of the incongruity theory, arguing that humor arising from a failure of a concept to account for an object of thought. When the particular outstrips the general, we are faced with an incongruity. Schopenhauer also emphasizes the element of surprise, saying that "the greater and more unexpected [. . .] this incongruity is, the more violent will be his laughter" (1818, I, Sec. 13).

As stated by Kant and Schopenhauer, the incongruity theory of humor specifies a necessary condition of the object of humor. Focusing on the humorous object, leaves something out of the analysis of humor, since there are many kinds of things that are incongruous which do not produce amusement. A more robust statement of the incongruity theory would need to include the pleasurable response one has to humorous objects. John Morreall attempts to find sufficient conditions for identifying humor by focusing on our response. He defines humorous amusement as taking pleasure in a cognitive shift. The incongruity theory can be stated as a response focused theory, claiming that humor is a certain kind of reaction had to perceived incongruity.

Henri Bergson's essay "Laughter" (1980) is perhaps the one of the most influential and sophisticated theories of humor. Bergson's theory of humor is not easily classifiable, since it has elements of superiority and incongruity theories. In a famous phrase, Bergson argues that the source of humor is the "mechanical encrusted upon the living" (p. 84) According to Bergson "the comic does not exist outside of what is strictly human." He thinks that humor involve an incongruous relationship between human intelligence and habitual or mechanical behaviors. As such, humor serves as a social corrective, helping people recognize behaviors that are inhospitable to human flourishing. A large source of the comic is in recognizing our superiority over the subhuman. Anything that threatens to reduce a person to an object—either animal or mechanical—is prime material for humor. No doubt, Bergson's theory accounts for much of physical comedy and bodily humor, but he seems to over-estimate the necessity of mechanical encrustation. It is difficult to see how his theory can accommodate most jokes and sources of humor coming from wit.

Three major criticisms of the incongruity theory are that it is too broad to be very meaningful, it is insufficiently explanatory in that it does not distinguish between non-humorous incongruity and basic incongruity, and that revised versions still fail to explain why some things, rather than others, are funny. We have already addressed the third criticism: it confuses the object of humor with the response. What is at issue is the definition of humor, or how to identify humor, not how to create a humor-generating algorithm. The incongruity theorist has a response to this criticism as well, since they can claim that humor is pleasure in incongruity.

d. Play Theories

Describing play theories of humor as an independent school or approach might overstate their relative importance, although they do serve as a good representative of theories focused on the functional question. By looking at the contextual characteristic, play theories try to classify humor as a species of play. In this general categorization effort, the play theorists are not so much listing necessary conditions, as they are asking us to look at humor as an extension of animal play. They try to call our attention to the structural similarities between play contexts and humorous context, to suggest that what might be true of play, might be true of humor as well.

Play theorists often take an ethological approach to studying humor, tracing it back through evolutionary development. They look at laughter triggers like tickling, that are found in other species, to suggest that in humor ontogeny recapitulates phylogeny. In The Enjoyment of Laughter (1936), Max Eastman develops a play theory of humor with an adaptive story. He thinks we can find analogies of humor in the behavior of animals, especially in the proto-laughter of chimps to tickling. He goes so far as to argue that the wagging tail of a happy dog is a form of humorous laughter, since Eastman wants to broaden the definition of laughter to encompass other rhythmic responses to pleasure. Speaking more specifically of humor, he argues that "we come into the world endowed with an instinctive tendency to laugh and have this feeling in response to pains presented playfully" (p. 45). On Eastman's account, what is central to humor and play is that both require taking a disinterested attitude towards what might otherwise be seen as serious.

Eastman considers humor to be a form of play, because humor involves a disinterested stance, certain kinds of humor involve mock aggression and insults, and because some forms of play activities result in humorous amusement. Since Eastman defines play as the adoption of this disinterested attitude, humor would count as a form of play on his definition, but this seems both too restrictive and too vague to serve as an adequate definition of play. In Homo Ludens (1938), Johan Huizinga criticizes identifying play with laughter or the comic. Though both seem to involve "the opposite of seriousness," there are crucial asymmetries. Laughter, he argues, is particular to humans, whereas, play is found in other mammals and birds. Also, if we allow for certain types of competitive play, then a non-serious attitude is not essential to play, as it seems to be for humor. Identifying the comic, or humor, with play is problematic, since "in itself play is not comical for either for the player or public" (1938, p. 6). Huizinga questions whether humor and play share any necessary conditions, a requirement of the relationship if humor is a subtype of play. This will, of course, depend on how we describe humor and play, two equally elusive notions.

Play theorists are primarily concerned with the problem of determining the function of humor in order to explain how it might have adaptive value, a task taken up by other biological theories of humor. They argue that similarities between play and humor suggest that the adaptive value of play might be similar to that of humor. Other researchers focused on the functional questions have described humor as having value in cognitive development, social skill learning, tension relief, empathy management, immune system benefits, stress relief, and social bonding. Though these questions are primarily addressed by psychologists, sociologist, anthropologists, and medical researchers, their studies rely on and contribute to an evolving notion of just what counts as humor. Though the functional question is foremost in these theories, play theory tries to give humor a genus by offering some differentiating characteristics, essential to humor.

e. Summary of Humor Theories

We discussed four different schools of humor theories and noted how each reveals aspects common, if not necessary, to humor. Presenting these theories as rivals is misleading since, as we have seen, theorists in each classification focus on different problems and may draw upon the answers to different questions from another school. For instance, while focusing on why we find something funny, Spencer offers a functional explanation and relies on the answer incongruity theorists give to the question of what we find funny. Relief theories and Play theories tend to focus on the function humor serves in human life, though the functional question cannot be separated from characterizing amusement, or the humor response. Superiority theorists tend to focus on what feelings are necessary for there to be humor, or why we find some things funny. Incongruity theories have the most to say about the object of humor, though variants identify humor with the way we respond to a perceived incongruity. Though the functional, stimuli, and response questions are not neatly separated, the differing schools tend to assume that one question is more basic than the others.

3. References and Further Reading

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  • Bergson, Henri (1980). "Laughter." Trans. Wylie Sypher, in Comedy, eds. Wylie Sypher. Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • Berman, Merrie (1986). "How Many Feminists Does It Take To Make A Joke? Sexist Humor and What's Wrong With It." Hypatia, vol. 1, no. 1, Spring, pp. 63-82.
  • Caplow, Theodore (1968). Two Against One: Coalitions in Triads. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice Hall.
  • Carroll, Noel, ed. (2001a). Beyond Aesthetics: Philosophical Essays. New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Carroll, Noel (2001b). "Horror and Humor" in Carroll (2001a), pp. 235-253.
  • Carroll, Noel (2001c). "Moderate Moralism" in Carroll (2001a), pp. 293- 306.
  • Carroll, Noel (2001d). "On Jokes" in Carroll (2001), pp. 317-334.
  • Carroll, Noel (1996). "Notes on the Sight Gag" in Noel Carroll Theorizing the Moving Image. New York, Cambridge Univesrity Press.
  • Carroll, Noel (1997). "Words, Images, and Laughter." Persistence of Vision, no. 14, pp. 42-52.
  • Chapman, A. J., & Foot, H. C., eds. (1976). Humour and laughter: Theory, research, and applications. London: John Wiley & Sons.
  • Cohen, Ted (1999). Jokes: Philosophical Perspectives on Laughing Matters. Chicago: Chicago Univesrity Press.
  • Critchley, Simon (2002). On Humour. New York: Routledge.
  • De Sousa, Ronald (1987). "When is it Wrong to Laugh?" Ch. 11 of The Rationality of Emotion. Cambridge, MIT.
  • Descartes, René. (1649/1987). Les Passions de L'ame. Paris. Excerpts in Morreall.
  • Dundes, Alan (1987). Cracking Jokes: Studies of Sick Humor Cycles and Stereotypes. Berkeley: Ten Speed Press.
  • Dwyer, Tom (1991). "Humor, Power, and Change in organizations." Human Relations, vol. 44, no. 1, pp. 1-19.
  • Eastman, Max (1936). Enjoyment of Laughter. New York: Halcyon House.
  • Eitzen, Dirk (2000). "Comedy and Classicism." Film Theory and Philosophy. Eds. Richard Allen and Murray Smith. New York: Oxford Univesrity Press.
  • Freud, Sigmund (1928). "Humor." International Journal of Psychoanalysis, 9, pp. 1-6.
  • Freud, Sigmund (1905/1960). Jokes and their Relation to the Unconscious. Trans. J. Strachey. New York: W. W. Norton. (Original work published 1905).
  • Gaut, Berys (1998). "Just Joking: The Ethics and Aesthetics of Humor." Philosophy and Literature, 22 (1), pp. 51-68.
  • Goldstein, J. H., & McGhee, P. E., eds. (1972). The Psychology of Humor: Theoretical Perspectives and Empirical Issues. New York: Academic Press.
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  • Handelman, Don (1990/1998). Models and Mirrors: towards and anthropology of public events. New York: Berghahn Books. (Originally published by Cambridge University Press in 1990.)
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  • Lyttle, Jim (manuscript). The Effectiveness of Humor in Persuasion: The Case of Business Ethics Training. URL = <>.
  • Mast, Gerald (1979). The Comic Mind: Comedy and the Movies. Chicago; Univesrity of Chicago Press. (First published in 1973.)
  • McGhee, P. E., & Goldstein, J. H., eds. (1983). Handbook of Humor Research: Basic Issues, Vol. 1. New York: Springer-Verlag.
  • McGinn, Colin (1997). Ethics, Evil, and Fiction. New York: Oxford.
  • Morreall, John. (1983). "Humor and emotion." American Philosophical Quarterly, 20, pp. 297-304.
  • Morreall, John. (1989). "Enjoying incongruity." HUMOR: International Journal of Humor Research, 2, pp. 1-18.
  • Morreall, John. (1987). The Philosophy of Laughter and Humor. New York, SUNY.
  • Morreall, John. (1983). Taking Laughter Seriously. New York: SUNY.
  • Nilsen, Alleen Pace & Don L. F. Nilsen (2000). Encyclopedia of 20th-Century American Humor. Phoenix: Oxry Press.
  • Philips, Michael (1984). "Racist Acts and Racist Humor." Canadian Journal of Philosophy, vol. 14, no. 1, March, pp. 75-96.
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  • Roberts, Robert C. (1988). "Is Amusement and Emotion.' American Philosophical Quartery, vol. 5, no. 3, July, pp. 269-273.
  • Rothenberg, Paula S, ed. (1988). Racism and Sexism: An Integrated Study. New York: St. Martin's Press.
  • Ryan, Kathryn M. & Jeanne Kanjorski (1998). "The Enjoyment of Sexist Humor,
    Rape Attitudes, and Relationship Aggression in College Students." Sex Roles, vol. 38, no. 9/10, May, pp. 743-756.
  • Sankowski, Edward (1977). "Responsibility of persons for Their Emotions." Canadian Journal of Philosophy vol. VIII, no. 4, December, pp. 829-840.
  • Schopenhauer, Arthur (1818). The World as Will and Representation.
  • Shultz, T. R. (1972). The role of incongruity and resolution in children's appreciation of cartoon humor. Journal of Experimental Child Psychology, 13 (3), pp. 456-477.
  • Snyder, Mark (1998). "Self-Fulfilling Stereotypes." In Rothenberg (1998), pp. 263-268.
  • Solomon, Robert (2002). "Are the Three Stooges Funny? Soitainly! (or When is it OK to Laugh?)." Ethics and Values in the Information Age, eds. Joel Rudinow and Anthony Graybosch. Wadsworth.
  • Spencer, Herbert. (1860). "The Physiology of Laughter." Macmillan's Magazine, 1, pp. 395-402.
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Author Information

Aaron Smuts
University of Wisconsin-Madison
U. s. A.

The Aesthetics of Popular Music

music-poPopular music is widely assumed to be different in kind from the serious music or art music that, until very recently, monopolized attention in philosophical discussions of music. In recent years, however, popular music has become an important topic for philosophers pursuing either of two projects. First, popular music receives attention from philosophers who see it as a test case for prevailing philosophies of music. Even now, most philosophy of music concentrates on the European classical repertoire. Therefore, if there are important differences between popular and art music, widening the discussion to include popular music might encourage us to reconsider the nature of music. Second, popular music increasingly serves as a focal point in general debates about art and aesthetic value. A growing number of philosophers regard popular music as a vital and aesthetically rich field that has been marginalized by traditional aesthetics. They argue that popular music presents important counterexamples to entrenched doctrines in the philosophy of art. Similar issues arise for the aesthetics of jazz, but the special topic of jazz is beyond the scope of this article.

Although the category of popular music presupposes differences from serious music, there is limited consensus about the nature of these differences beyond the near-tautology that most people prefer popular music to art music. This obvious disparity in popular reception generates philosophical (and not merely sociological) issues when it is combined with the plausible assumption that popular music is aesthetically different from folk music, art music, and other music types. There is general agreement about the concept’s extension or scope of reference – agreement that the Beatles made popular music but Igor Stravinsky did not. However, there is no comparable agreement about what “popular music” means or which features of the music are distinctively popular. Recent philosophizing about popular music generally sidesteps the issue of defining it. Discussion of particular genres or examples of popular music can be used to advance broader philosophical projects. Such arguments have concentrated on rock music, blues, and hip-hop.

Among the topics that have benefited from this reconsideration are the nature of music’s aesthetic value, music’s claim to autonomy, and the ontology of music.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Background
  2. Adorno and Standard Criticisms
  3. Defending Popular Music
  4. Race, Gender, and Expressive Authenticity
  5. Ontology of Music
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Historical Background

Since both Plato and Aristotle philosophized about music, philosophy of music predates and is not identical with modern philosophy of art. Nonetheless, most philosophy of music is strongly influenced by the aesthetic assumptions of modernism. Eighteenth-century philosophers organized a new field of study, aesthetics, around the search for a unifying principle for the disparate “fine arts” of post-Renaissance Europe. This principle would distinguish science and craft from such activities as music, poetry, theater, dance, painting, and sculpture. Following this precedent, most subsequent theorizing about music inherited distinctively modernist biases about art. Three ideas proved to be particularly relevant to later efforts to distinguish art from popular art. First, art is the product of genius. Art is constantly evolving, so successful new art involves progress. Second, the value of art is aesthetic, and aesthetic value is autonomous. Artistic value cannot be reduced to utility, moral effects, or social functions. Third, whatever is true about fine art is true about music. From the middle of the eighteenth century until the middle of the nineteenth, philosophers regarded music as a pillar of the emerging system of the fine arts. As a result, music could not be regarded as art if it lacked genius and autonomy. By the beginning of the twentieth century, most intellectuals endorsed the elitist consensus that popular music lacks these features.

Despite its influence on subsequent theorizing, the eighteenth-century intellectual framework did not recognize a clear distinction between fine art and popular art. For example, Immanuel Kant’s philosophy of art is a landmark work in eighteenth-century aesthetics. It places great emphasis on genius and artistic autonomy. These elements of the Kantian aesthetic are often cited to dismiss the art status of popular music. Many subsequent philosophical analyses of the distinction between art music and popular music draw on his proposal that the lesser arts dull the mind. Lacking the interplay of ideas and formal experimentation that characterizes fine art, the popular arts are mere entertainment (see Kaplan, 354-55). Nonetheless, it is important to note that Kant does not himself recognize the field of popular art, so he does not align the lesser arts and popular art. Furthermore, his general position on the value of music is inconclusive. Given his subsequent reputation as a formalist, readers are often surprised to discover his worry that instrumental music “merely plays with sensations” and therefore “has the lowest place among the fine arts” (Kant, 199). Taken seriously, Kant’s remarks suggest that songs are to be ranked higher than instrumental music. As such, Kant might assign greater artistic value to a folk song than to J. S. Bach’s Brandenburg concertos.

Eighteenth century philosophy’s silence on differences between art songs and popular songs must not be construed as evidence that no one yet discussed “popular” music. Where we do find discussion of this topic in the eighteenth-century, popularity is not yet opposed to art. For instance, at roughly the same time that Kant questions instrumental music’s merits as a fine art, the composer W. A. Mozart writes of the importance of providing his operas with memorable, popular melodies. Even here, however, it would be anachronistic to suppose that Enlightenment categories support a clear distinction between art music and popular music. At best, philosophers of this period postulated differences between refined and vulgar taste. This distinction between better and worse taste gradually developed into an explicit recognition of a distinctive sphere of popular culture and music, with a corresponding stigmatization of the “low” or popular (Shiner, 94-98).

A more rigid distinction between art music and other music gradually emerges during the nineteenth century. By the middle of the century, philosophical discussions of music begin to make sporadic reference to what we now recognize as popular music. Philosophy of music increasingly concentrates on explaining why recent European concert music is musically distinctive and superior. Emphasizing Kant’s idea of autonomous aesthetic value, Eduard Hanslick focuses on pure instrumental music. The art of music is the art of structuring tones. Only structural properties matter, and they matter only for themselves. Impure music that relies on words or emotional expression pleases audiences with non-musical attractions. In this analysis, most popular music pleases its audience by its extra-musical rewards. In defending the aesthetic superiority of instrumental music, Hanslick’s aesthetic formalism reinforces the view that popular music, which emphasizes song, lacks artistic merit. Hanslick deploys a Kantian aesthetic to undermine Kant’s concerns about instrumental music’s lack of artistic value.

A quarter century later, Edmund Gurney provides additional arguments for musical autonomy. Although he allows that popular music can be melodically valuable, Gurney’s attack on the distractions of emotional expression clearly consigns most popular music to an inferior category. Hanslick and Gurney are both reacting against the Romantic tendency to value music’s expressive capacity. Responding to the longstanding idea that music expresses emotion by generating a felt, bodily response, both Hanslick and Gurney insist that bodily engagement indicates an inferior response. Again, they extend a Kantian theme. Kant argues that bodily responses create a personal interest that is incompatible with a universalizable and “pure” aesthetic judgment. Together, Hanslick and Gurney are an important source of the view that popular music is inferior because its primary appeal is visceral, bodily, and felt. In contrast, the abstract structures of classical music demand an intellectual response. The body hears, but only the intellect listens (see Baugh 1993, Gracyk 2007).

Gurney is not entirely negative about popular music. He distinguishes between popular music as “low” commercial music found “in common theaters and places of public entertainment” and popular music as that which appeals to virtually anyone in a society who is exposed to it (407). Folk music comprises most of the latter category. This category also includes appealing melodies of operatic arias and other classical works. Gurney already recognizes, in 1880, that the maintenance of social strata requires stereotypes that unnecessarily limit access to a wide variety of music. Consequently, true popularity is seldom cultivated. Gurney is particularly critical of Richard Wagner’s idea that genuine popularity is constrained by nationalism. For Gurney, music cannot be popular if its appeal is limited by social boundaries of any sort.

Setting a different precedent, Friedrich Nietzsche’s views on music are a byproduct of his general philosophy of culture. Nietzsche initially defends the superiority of certain strains of European classical music. He praises composers whose irrational genius provides the Dionysian energy needed to correct the rational excesses of European culture. Nietzsche eventually reverses himself. In an extended attack on Richard Wagner’s operas, he rejects the continuing value of the “great” style that characterizes art music. In what amounts to a reversal of Kantian aesthetic priorities, Nietzsche praises Georges Bizet’s widely popular opera Carmen (1875) for its triviality and simplicity (see Sweeney-Turner). However, most philosophers ignore Nietzsche’s defense of “light” music.

Nietzsche aside, philosophy of music has been dominated by the view that the best music is autonomous and formally complex (John Dewey is almost alone in defending the vitality of popular art during this time period. Unfortunately, Dewey said very little about music.). As recently as 1990, philosophy of popular music consisted of variations on a single theme. Philosophers defended the twin assumptions that popular music is essentially different from “serious” or art music, and that the former is aesthetically inferior to the latter. As a result, most philosophers who bothered to discuss popular music concentrated on identifying the aesthetic deficiencies inherent in such music.

2. Adorno and Standard Criticisms

Theodor Adorno offers an influential, philosophically sophisticated account of the nature of twentieth-century popular music. He is the single best source for the view that popular music is simplistic, repetitive, and boring, and that it remains this way because commercial forces manipulate it in order to placate and manipulate the masses who passively respond to it. Although a Marxist orientation influences almost all of his arguments, his influence is apparent in many writers who are not explicitly Marxists. Unfortunately, Adorno is a notoriously difficult writer. His writings on music are subtle, dense, and fill many hundreds of pages.

Adorno begins with the insight that popular music is characterized by the synthesis of entertainment values and mass art. Twentieth-century popular music is mass art because commercial forces now produce it on an industrial model. It is a commodity aimed at the largest possible number of consumers. Therefore it must combine a high degree of standardization with relative accessibility, and so the same rhythms and structures appear again and again. Yet a constant supply of new “product” must be marketed to consumers. As a result, popular music competes with and replaces local and regional folk traditions (In the wake of the industrial revolution, genuine folk art is no longer possible.). In a commercial world where one popular song sounds much like any other, popular music cannot function as a medium of genuine communication. At best, a philosophically reflective stance sees that its standardization and commercial presentation reflects important facets of the socio-economic conditions that shape it. Its standardization reflects the alienating, oppressive standardization of modern capitalism. The momentarily pleasurable diversions offered by popular music are mere distractions from this alienation – a process that the music itself reinforces. Since it fails to satisfy any genuine needs, exposure to popular music encourages an endless repetition of the cycle of consumption, boredom, alienation, and fresh distraction through consumption.

Adorno’s analysis of popular music is transformed into outright criticism of it when he contrasts it with “art” music. We cannot complain about popular music if our culture cannot provide a more satisfying alternative. If nothing better is available, then there is nothing especially wrong with popular music. Adorno argues that objectively better music is available. He is sophisticated enough to avoid a simple contrast of classical and popular music. For Adorno, almost all of the music that passes as art music is just as bad. It is barely comprehended by its audience, most of whom respond approvingly to its familiarity. Radical composers such as Arnold Schoenberg, however, provide art music that is socially progressive. This music challenges listeners by presenting them with more “truth” than other twentieth-century music. For Adorno, artistic truth is neither a matter of saying conventionally true things nor of making socially oppositional statements (Within the socio-economic framework of capitalism, the political stance of punk or hip-hop is just another “hook” and marketing tool.). Artistic truth is relative to the time and place of its creation and reception. It requires music that is sufficiently autonomous from socio-economic pressures to permit compositional integrity. For example, our expectations for aesthetic pleasure previously placed a premium on beauty. The quest for beauty curtails genuine autonomy. Therefore musical integrity comes at a cost: good music no longer offers us the beauty of conventional fine art. Instead, it must be compositionally complex enough to incorporate and display the contradictory demands that we impose on art. By comparison, music that is readily understood and immediately pleasurable is not autonomous. It neither discloses nor opposes society’s dominant socio-economic framework. Given these requirements, very little music succeeds in forcing listeners to deal with the contradictions of modernity. Popular music fares worst of all. Its requirement of accessibility deprives it of social truth, so it lacks any genuinely progressive social role.

Adorno sees no important distinctions within popular music. His analysis is subject to challenge on the grounds that some popular music lacks conventional beauty and easy pleasures. However, Adorno can reply that such music cannot simultaneously achieve popularity while offering artistic truth, for that truth cannot be conveyed by music that is accessible enough to generate a commercial profit. Several philosophers (Brown 2005, Gracyk 1996) have responded that some jazz and rock musicians are counterexamples to Adorno’s analysis. Charlie Parker and John Coltrane made commercial recordings and so must be “popular,” as Adorno understands the category. Yet they created autonomous, challenging music. The commercial framework of twentieth century music has not eradicated artistic truth as Adorno defines it.

Adorno aside, popular music received limited philosophical attention before the early 1960s. Then the British Journal of Aesthetics published articles on the topic by Frank Howes and Peter Stadlen. Although the Beatles are not mentioned in either article, it is interesting to note that this pair of essays appeared in the same year and country that gave the world the Beatles’s debut recordings, “Love Me Do” and “Please Please Me.” Within two years, the Beatles’s musical intelligence and emergence as an international cultural force invited serious reconsideration of the claim that repetition and cognitive vapidity define popular music. Although neither Howes nor Stadlen cites Adorno, their analyses endorse many of his basic ideas. Howes sets out to explain why “there is little bad folk music and much bad popular music” (247). Where Gurney treats folk music as a species of popular music, Howes opposes the two categories. Howes proposes that the communal composition and ongoing re-fashioning of folk music ensures a unique combination of simplicity and excellence. In contrast, popular music is created for immediate widespread consumption and thus prioritizes “ease of comprehension,” discouraging musical development and subtlety. Popular music is more often “indifferent” than it is bad through incompetence. Like Adorno, Howes thinks that popular music must employ excessive repetition and crude clichés.

Stadlen departs from Howes in recognizing that the emergence of blues music represented a “novel type of virtuosity” and an unheralded combination of tragic and comic elements (359). Otherwise, Stadlen regards popular or “light” music as aesthetically impoverished for its avoidance of musical complication and for its juvenile emotional ambivalence about sex, which it exploits for its emotional impact. In a few short paragraphs, Stadlen encapsulates most of the position that Allan Bloom revived more hyperbolically in 1987.

3. Defending Popular Music

To summarize the modernist view, genres of art develop a hierarchy. “Higher” forms of music satisfy the most advanced modes of response. Superior genres require attention to abstract structures, so they require active, focused listening. Therefore the best music is found in the classical repertoire, where composers have emphasized autonomy and cognitive complexity. By comparison, popular music is aesthetically deficient. It sacrifices autonomy because its design is driven by functional demands for emotional expression and for dance rhythms. Popularity requires accessibility, so popular music cannot combine popularity and complexity.

Richard Shusterman has produced several essays that challenge these standard dismissals of popular music. Bringing a more balanced perspective to the philosophical debate, these essays demonstrate that popular music is philosophically more interesting than modernism suggests. Inspired by Dewey’s pragmatism, Shusterman argues that the social distinction between high and low music does not correspond to any distinctive aesthetic differences. He offers no analysis of either “popular art” or “popular music.” Instead, he focuses on highly selective examples of popular music that achieve “complex aesthetic effects,” thereby satisfying our “central artistic criteria” (2000b, pp. 215-16). Good popular music satisfies the aesthetic criteria routinely used to praise serious music. Although Shusterman concedes that a great deal of popular music is aesthetically poor and may have negative social effects, he argues that at least some of it succeeds aesthetically while offering a socially progressive challenge to prevailing cultural biases.

Shusterman’s arguments are based on a very small sample of rock, hip-hop, and country music. He identifies and criticizes a core set of criticisms that are typically directed against popular music. He focuses on its alleged lack of creativity, originality, and artistic autonomy. He also replies to claims that it degrades culture generally by offering an inferior substitute for better music, that its escapism makes for shallow rewards, and that it encourages an uncritical passivity that generates a disengaged populace (2000b, pp. 173-77). (Most of these arguments originate in Adorno. Several of them are found in Roger Scruton and Julian Johnson, neither of whom endorses Adorno’s Marxism.) Against these criticisms, Shusterman argues that the rewards and pleasures of art music are no less transitory than those of popular music, that critics over-emphasize art’s capacity to engage the intellect, and that the standards used to discredit popular art are essentially Romantic in origin and therefore offer a historically limited perspective on the nature and value of art.

Directly responding to Adorno, Shusterman’s pragmatism rejects the modernist opposition of art and “life” (2000b). Shusterman recommends aesthetic criteria that are broad enough to endorse the functional dimension of every art form. These proposals gain specificity in Shusterman’s response to the charge that popular music is formulaic and falls short of the formal achievement of good music. Resisting the traditional association of form and intellectual engagement, he argues that musical form should be rooted in “organic bodily rhythms” and the social conditions that make them meaningful (199). Popular music’s continuing reliance on dance rhythms returns Western music to its “natural roots” (2000a, p. 4). The fundamental structure of popular music lies in its bodily rhythms, so movement is necessary for appreciating it. Since these movements bear meanings, a genuine response to music is both physical and intellectual. This active, bodily engagement is also supplemented by awareness of lyrics because songs dominate popular music. When language is connected to the music’s rhythms, the integrated experience of music and language is as creative and complex as is the experience of “high” or classical music.

Shusterman’s most important essays are “Form and Funk: The Aesthetic Challenge of Popular Art” and “The Fine Art of Rap” (both in 2000b). The latter focuses on hip-hop recordings that are verbally complex, philosophically insightful, and rhythmically funky. They are aesthetically satisfying in a way that integrates both bodily and intellectual responses. The best hip-hop presents a life philosophy. However, concentrating on a handful of exemplary cases does not demonstrate that popular music is generally complex in this manner. For this purpose, Shusterman’s arguments should be considered in light of the recent outpouring of books that discuss philosophy’s relevance to different popular musicians. These books feature essays that explore the philosophical underpinnings of groups such as the Beatles, the Grateful Dead, Metallica, and U2. These analyses show that Shusterman’s limited examples cannot be dismissed as the rare exceptions in popular music. They also correct another major bias. Adopting Hanslick’s position that an aesthetics of music must be an aesthetics of instrumental or “absolute” music, traditional philosophy of music pays little attention to songs. It is clear that many accessible popular songs grapple with complex ideas and issues, however.

Finally, Shusterman argues that some popular music has the additional merit of presenting a postmodern challenge to the modernist categories that have dominated philosophical aesthetics (2000a). In particular, hip-hop often highlights postmodern strategies of recycling and appropriation. It engages with the concerns of subcultures and localized communities rather than with an allegedly universal perspective. These strategies reverse and thus repudiate modernist standards of artistic value. This line of argument does little to address traditional criticisms of popular music, however. Instead, it acknowledges that popular music is deficient according to traditional standards while also contending that cultural change renders those standards irrelevant. This argument does not answer critics who still endorse traditional views about art because the force of this argument depends on a complex understanding of historical developments in art and aesthetics. Furthermore, Shusterman’s appeal to postmodernism suggests that when we find anything in popular music that is not endorsed by traditional aesthetic theory, its presence can be interpreted as a challenge to the dominant tradition. Shusterman thus weakens his earlier charge that aesthetic theory has systematically misrepresented the nature of most art. Traditional aesthetic categories still frame the debate as popular music divides into two broad categories. Good popular music succeeds according to either modernist or postmodernist values. Either way, popular music is evaluated according to fine art standards (see Gracyk 2007). Shusterman supplements his discussions of rock and hip-hop with an independent essay on country music (2000a). He focuses on a small genre of films about the careers of fictional country singers. This essay moves Shusterman away from the bifurcation just outlined. Country music is discussed without reference to either modernist or postmodernist standards. Instead of arguing that country music is aesthetically complex and socially progressive, Shusterman focuses on the issue of how country music succeeds in conveying emotional authenticity to its fans. He thus endorses a line of analysis that is found in many ethnomusicological analyses of popular music. Shusterman concedes that country music is excessively sentimental and that commercial processes undercut its claim to authenticity. Nonetheless, it is comparatively authentic to its fans for a variety of reasons. First, its working class white audience is generally “uncritical” and, due to social circumstances, seeks “easy emotional release” in music (86). Second, it is commercially positioned as more authentic than contemporary alternatives in popular music. Third, its emphasis on first-person storytelling has a self-validating authority. Together, these factors give country music an aura of authenticity that explains its appeal. It is striking that this analysis cites neither aesthetic excellence nor progressive ideas to account for the music’s popular success, however. Hence Shusterman’s analysis offers no answer to critics who dismiss country music as simplistic and politically reactionary.

Inspired by Shusterman’s analysis of hip-hop, Crispin Sartwell offers an alternative and arguably more satisfying account of the value of blues and country music. Building on the general theme that a modernist aesthetic does not apply to most art produced by most cultures, Sartwell builds on Dewey’s theme that healthy arts involve form and expression that give a unifying coherence to everyday experiences. Hence, popular music should not be judged against the elitist ideals that have dominated aesthetic theory. It must be judged in relation to its capacity to embody and consolidate social relationships and values that are central to the society that creates and assimilates it.

In place of Shusterman’s appeal to a comparative authenticity, Sartwell calls attention to the importance of genuine tradition in blues and country music. For several generations, both kinds of music have evolved organically in response to social change. These musical traditions have not changed for the sake of originality and novelty, as encouraged by modernist aesthetics. Art music embraces progress that dictates continuously new forms, experiments, and innovations. Blues and country music constantly re-adapt established forms and signifiers. They change as necessary to remain relevant in the face of changing circumstances. As a result, ongoing styles of American popular music are extraordinarily successful at expressing racial, generational, and class-specific values in a way that remains comprehensible and emotionally satisfying to almost everyone in their respective audiences. As such, the vitality of popular music is best seen by highlighting its commonalities with non-Western art. Sartwell argues that the continuity of American popular music does an admirable job of satisfying non-Western expectations for art, especially those articulated in Asian traditions infused with Confucianism.

Bruce Baugh (1993) defends popular music by concentrating on rock music. His position recalls Shusterman’s argument that the best popular music exhibits a postmodern rejection of modernist aesthetic standards. Baugh contends that rock music and European concert music succeed according to different and opposing aesthetic standards. Traditional musical aesthetics was formulated by reference to the European classical repertoire. Therefore what is valuable about rock music cannot be explained by appeal to aesthetic standards appropriate to Mozart or Wagner. Baugh proposes that rock music is best appreciated by “turning Kantian or formalist aesthetics on its head” (26), literally reversing traditional priorities. Rock places more value on performance than composition, more on material embodiment than structure, more on rhythm than melody and harmony, more on expressivity than formal beauty, and more on heteronomy than autonomy. Like Shusterman, Baugh thinks that this music is fundamentally experienced in the body, especially through dancing, rather than by listening intellectually, without moving. Rock music thus serves as evidence of the limitations of traditional musical aesthetics. Traditional aesthetics concentrates on aesthetic standards “appropriate to only a very small fragment of the world’s music” (28).

Against Baugh, James O. Young and Stephen Davies argue that rock and classical music do not invite evaluation under distinct standards. Young argues that Baugh merely shows that rock music tends to employ different means of expression, not that the music has different ends. The European concert tradition includes a great deal of music that prioritizes expressivity and requires performance practices that highlight the music’s material embodiment. Consequently, Baugh has not identified standards that are unique to rock. Davies (1999) criticizes Baugh’s strategy of aligning classical and rock with intellect and body, respectively. Since music is patterned sound, anything that counts as listening to music will require attention to both form and matter. Davies also attacks Baugh’s assumption that a bodily or somatic response is noncognitive. A somatic response to music is a response to its pattern of movement. This response requires awareness of its distinctive pattern of tensions and relaxations, which requires knowledge of the “grammar” of the appropriate musical style. A visceral, somatic response seems immediate and nonintellectual to listeners. The response actually requires a considerable amount of cognitive processing, however. In a similar manner, the expressive power of rock music is due to, and not opposed to, a cognitive response.

In their responses to Baugh, Young and Davies spend much of their time summarizing and refuting the alleged differences between rock and classical music. As a consequence, it is easy to lose sight of the larger issue that emerges. To what extent is there such a thing as “traditional musical aesthetics,” and to what extent have philosophers adequately formulated the standards for any music? Shusterman and Baugh assume that Hanslick and Gurney accurately describe European art music and its associated listening standards. This assumption leads them to reason that because popular music is different from art music, popular music cannot be understood by appeal to prevailing standards of musical value. Young and Davies suggest a more radical response, however, by proposing that classical music is far more varied than modernism allows. To the extent that modernist standards of musical excellence fail to make sense of popular music, those standards may be equally distorting for most of the European classical repertoire. (To some extent, Adorno already recognizes this point when he argues that Stravinsky and Schoenberg are engaged in very different aesthetic projects, so that Stravinsky has more in common with popular music than with Schoenberg’s rejection of a tonal hierarchy.)

4. Race, Gender, and Expressive Authenticity

In the second half of the twentieth century, philosophy of art came to be seen as a kind of meta-criticism, identifying legitimate and illegitimate patterns of critical activity directed toward the arts. Derived from analytic philosophy’s concern for language and logic, this approach must not be confused with Adorno’s Marxist position that the best art is always a powerful vehicle for cultural criticism, demonstrating a corresponding failure of the popular arts due to their critical passivity. For the most part, philosophers in the so-called “analytic” tradition do not claim to have any special insights into the nature of music. With a few notable exceptions, such as Roger Scruton, they have abandoned the traditional project of developing a privileged critical perspective from which to sort music into better and worse kinds. Today, analytic philosophers are more likely to examine what is characteristically said about music as a starting point for examining our implicit assumptions about it. Once the emphasis shifts to an examination of the logic of what is said about music, popular and art music are revealed to be equally rich fields for philosophical analysis. As a result, an increasing number of philosophers have investigated popular music by identifying and critiquing key concepts that shape our response to this music. These investigations frequently incorporate insights gained from social and political philosophy.

Joel Rudinow adopts the analytic method in order to summarize and respond to the enormous body of non-philosophical writing about authenticity and the blues. He calls attention to the logic that supports criticisms of musical borrowing or appropriation of African-American music by white musicians and audiences. Addressing selected critics of white appropriation, Rudinow focuses on the social and conceptual issues embodied by white blues musicians.

Rudinow identifies, summarizes, and challenges the two most common arguments advanced against the phenomenon of blues music performed by white musicians. The first is the proprietary argument. It says that when one cultural community owns a musical style, its appropriation by another group constitutes a serious wrong. According to this argument, white blues players participate in a racist appropriation that deprives African-Americans of what is rightfully theirs. The second argument addresses experiential access. It says that white musicians lack relevant experiences that are necessary for expressive authenticity in the blues tradition. At best, white musicians produce blues-sounding music that cannot mean what the blues have traditionally meant. Unable to draw on the full cultural resources that inform the blues, white appropriations will be expressively superficial.

Rudinow responds to the proprietary argument by arguing there is no plausible analysis of ownership according to which a community or culture can “own” an artistic style. He responds to the experiential access argument by arguing that, absent a double standard, it will assign inauthenticity to recent African-American blues performances as readily as to white appropriations. In an argument that echoes Sartwell’s reflections on tradition, Rudinow points out that, after a century of development and change, the African-American experiences that were expressed in early blues cannot plausibly be the standard for evaluating contemporary blues. An evolving tradition that includes white participants is neither more nor less a departure from the core tradition than was, for example, the introduction of electric guitars. Furthermore, African-American experience is sufficiently diverse to allow some white musicians routes of initiation into experiences that can, in combination with mastery of the musical idiom, defuse the charge of mere posturing.

Paul Taylor responds by reviving the experiential access argument. He argues that the blues tradition was, and remains, a racial project. A blues performance is authentic only if it “can properly bear witness to the racialized moral pain that the blues is about” (314), and it only does so if it generates an appropriate feeling in informed listeners. These listeners care very much about the racial identity of performers and regard white performers as less capable of bearing witness about African-American experience. As a result, white appropriations do not generate the proper feeling in blues fans. Therefore white blues performances are not expressively authentic. Rudinow responds with two arguments. First, Taylor postulates a criterion for expressive authenticity that cannot be applied to most other music. Second, Taylor’s argument involves a question-begging assumption that the blues is a homogenous and static racial project. Because this assumption cannot be accepted a priori, it is readily challenged a posteriori by the fact that many African-American musicians and audiences admire the best white blues performers. Since Taylor’s argument links authenticity with audience response, these facts about audience response appear to certify the expressive authenticity of some white blues performances.

As Rudinow predicts (1996, p. 317), his exchange with Taylor merely sets the stage for further argument. Lee B. Brown (2004) explores the overlap between arguments about blues authenticity and longstanding debates about white jazz musicians. He documents and criticizes the outmoded essentialism found in such arguments. Expanding this topic to embrace the popularity of “world music,” Theodore Gracyk (2001) outlines and criticizes common assumptions about the communicative processes involved in popular music. Given that so much popular music is created and heard in recorded form, it is foolish to postulate a unified audience that responds uniformly. There are at least four distinct kinds of musical appropriation that can affect expressive authenticity, and there are at least three kinds of musical reception for any music listening that cross cultural boundaries. So it is implausible to maintain that blues music, to take one example, continues to be a unified cultural project. Popular music authenticity can only be determined on a case-by-case basis, by inspecting the complex interplay of cultural processes, musician’s intentions, and listener’s activities.

Jeanette Bicknell argues that the logic of authenticity is particularly complicated when it involves the singing of songs, as is the case with most popular music. Although some popular musicians compose their own material, such is not always the case. When listening to a song performance, audiences for popular music do not necessarily demand authenticity, narrowly construed. Because singing is akin to acting, each singer’s public persona influences the audience’s aesthetic response whenever a song is sung. This persona includes relatively obvious facts about a singer, such as ethnicity and gender, together with readily available information about the singer’s personal history. Bicknell proposes that most of the popular audience understands that few singers have a public persona that closely matches their “true personality” (263). Hence the actual standard of authenticity is the degree to which the material’s meaning seems appropriate to the singer’s public persona. Furthermore, singing is a physical activity. Few singers will seem authentic when they perform material that the audience regards as unsuitable for someone of their apparent race, gender, or age. For example, Johnny Cash’s performance of “Hurt” in the final year of his life is more expressively authentic than are performances by its composer, rock musician Trent Reznor. Due to the prominence of race in a singer’s persona, most white musicians will find it difficult to sing the blues convincingly. It is not impossible, however.

Feminist aesthetics raises many of the same issues that dominate debates about race and ethnicity. Furthermore, feminist aesthetics frequently discusses performance art. Exploring song performance, Bicknell argues that gender and race are equally relevant for popular song reception. Renée Cox and Claire Detels have provided a philosophical foundation for further work and Gracyk has outlined several philosophically rich issues that deserve further attention (Gracyk 2001). Yet as is the case with aesthetics in general, explicitly feminist analyses are usually directed at fine art and far more attention is paid to the visual arts than to music. In contrast, musicologists have produced many essays and books that highlight feminist perspectives on popular music.

5. Ontology of Music

Philosophy contains the sub-field of ontology. Proceeding from the assumption that different kinds of things exist in very different ways, ontology examines different categories of things that exist. Philosophers engage in musical ontology when they identify and analyze the various distinct kinds of things that count as music. For example, traditional philosophy of music distinguishes between a musical work and its performances. Unlike physical objects, the same musical work can be in different places at the same time, simply by being performed in two places simultaneously. Furthermore, not every performance seems to require reference to a pre-existing musical work. Many musicians improvise without performing any recognizable work. What kind of thing, then, is a musical work, such that George Gershwin’s “Summertime” remains the same musical work in a jazz performance by Billie Holiday and a rock performance by Janis Joplin? What is the shared object of musical attention when current audiences access these performances through the mediation of recording?

A number of philosophers think that popular music complicates the traditional ontology of music because the established distinction between works and performances has been supplemented by music that exists as recorded sound. Reflecting on popular music’s reliance on mass-mediation, Gracyk (1996, 2001), Fisher, Brown (2000), Davies (2001), and Kania argue that there are important aesthetic dimensions to the processes by which popular music, particularly rock music, is created and shared as recorded music. It is here, rather than in stylistic differences, that recent popular music differs most sharply from the classical repertoire.

Granted, most popular musicians make a significant amount of their income from live performances. Dedicated fans will often follow their favorite performers from show to show on the concert circuit. Others pay exorbitantly inflated prices to ticket agencies in order to secure prime seats when their favorite singer performs. Nonetheless, the audience for popular music generally spends more time with recorded music than with live music. Furthermore, the enormous return on investment made by the recording industry throughout most of the twentieth century led the industry to invest considerable time and creative energy in the process of recording music. These shifts of listening activity and creative investment have encouraged philosophers to examine the kinds of musical objects that are involved.

Before music was recorded, musical works were known almost exclusively by listening to musical performances or, for those with the proper training, by reading a score. This state of affairs presented a simple ontological or metaphysical analysis of the fundamental nature of musical works. Musical works are not physical particulars. Particular events and objects (performances and scores) provide access to the repeatable sound structures that constitute musical works. For example, Beethoven’s “Moonlight” piano sonata (Opus 27, No. 2) has received many thousands of performances since its composition in 1801. Each complete performance exists at a particular location for about a quarter hour. However, the musical work is an abstract structure that cannot be identified with any of its particular instantiations. The musical work is distinct from its performances, and the performances exist in order to make the work accessible to listeners.

Recordings complicate this straightforward ontological distinction between works and performances. Once recording technology became advanced enough to allow for the production of multiple copies of the same recording, it became necessary to distinguish between a recording (for example, Aretha Franklin’s 1967 hit record “Respect”), its various physical copies (for example, your 8-track and my vinyl 45), and the particular events that listeners hear (for example, the sounds produced from various car radios when a radio station broadcasts a copy of the record). Gracyk (1996) proposes that the experience of popular music now involves a complex web of particulars (for example, distinct performances and recording playbacks) and abstract objects (the song “Respect” and the 1967 “track” or recording of it). The song “Respect” was written by Otis Redding. Franklin subsequently performed the song in a studio, from which record producer Jerry Wexler created a recorded track. Gracyk proposes that Wexler’s recorded track is a distinct musical work, a work-for-playback related to but distinct from both Redding’s song and Franklins’ performance of it.

The relevance of ontological analysis begins to emerge in Davies’s (1999) response to Baugh’s analysis of rock music. Baugh contends that rock music places more emphasis on performances than compositions. Davies responds by noting that Baugh’s sweeping generalization arises from his failure to discuss ontology. Rock musicians, blues singers, and wedding bands do not fill their performances with free improvisations. They perform musical works. Successful performances of both “Respect” and Beethoven’s “Moonlight” piano sonata require performers to correctly perform that musical work and not some other. Whenever Franklin performs “Respect,” she is constrained by Redding’s musical composition (minimal as it may be). For Davies, the most important difference between the rock and classical traditions is that two very different kinds of musical works are normally performed. Beethoven’s sonatas are compositions of the European concert tradition and these works are ontologically “thicker” than popular songs. This simply means a work like the “Moonlight” sonata specifies relatively more of what should be heard during an authentic performance than is the case with the song “Respect” and other musical works in folk and popular music. The sonata is presented in a performance only if a high degree of what occurs during the performance is work-determinative. In other words, far more of the properties of a performance of the piano sonata are dictated by the musical work than is the case for a performance of “Respect.” In contrast, popular songs are generally “thinner” than works of the classical repertoire. Relatively few of the properties that appear in a given performance of “Respect” are present because they are essential to the identity of the musical work that is being performed.

Based on this distinction between thicker and thinner musical works, Baugh is wrong to contrast rock music and European art music by saying that rock music requires far less “faithfulness” to the music being performed. It is certainly true that performances of “Respect” will vary greatly in their performance arrangements and particular realizations. Where Redding is the only vocalist present on his 1965 recording of it, Franklin’s features backing vocalists. Where Franklin spells out the word “respect,” Redding does not. Both Redding and Franklin perform the same song, and they produce equally faithful or authentic performances of the same musical work despite their very different presentations of it. Their interpretative freedom is due to the fact that popular songs are thin with respect to work-constitutive properties and not because the performance matters more than the work that is being performed (Davies 1999).

Additional ontological complications arise when we address the nature of recorded music in each tradition. In the classical tradition, recordings function either to capture the sound of a particular live performance or they attempt to present the sound of an ideal performance (Davies 2001). Popular music developed a third function by exploiting studio technology to create inventive sonic presentations that are not meant to be judged by reference to what can be duplicated in live performance. Philosophers debate whether these recorded tracks constitute distinct, thick musical works. Gracyk (1996) and Kania propose that the studio engineering that is typical of rock and other popular music identifies such recordings as musical works in their own right. Like some electronic music of the European art tradition, the tracks created by many record producers are musical works that can only be instantiated through electronic playback (In fact, some popular music simply is electronic music.). Tracks are extremely thick musical works. The work (the track) determines most of what is heard during its instantiations, which are its playbacks.

Unlike works-for-playback in the art music tradition, popular music tracks feature songs or instrumental compositions that can also be performed live. Returning to the 1968 hit recording of “Respect,” Wexler’s track offers access to Redding’s song. Just as there are multiple performances of “Respect,” there are multiple recordings of it. Where each performance of “Respect” is a distinct instantiation of the song, something else must be said about Wexler’s track, which itself has distinct instantiations in its various playbacks. Listening to recorded music, the popular audience attends to both an ontologically thick work-for-playback and an ontologically thin song. A track’s production style can be distinguished from the song’s musical style. Thus there is a way in which popular music tracks are more complex than is electronic art music Electronic music offers no parallel distinction between track and composition.

Davies (2001) rejects the proposal that most popular song recordings feature two distinct musical works, the track and the song. He contends that there are very few cases in which two musical works are simultaneously available to an audience. For Davies, a recording is a distinct musical work only if the music cannot possibly be performed live. With music that can be performed live, one of two situations holds. Either way, the recorded track does not count as a distinct musical work. First, some recordings represent a studio performance of an ordinary musical work. An example is Franklin’s recorded performance of “Respect.” Second, the recording studio is sometimes used to create compositions or arrangements that are too complex or too electronically sophisticated to be performed live. Only derivative arrangements can be performed live. For example, the Beatles’s studio production of their 1966 song “Rain” features guitar and vocal parts that were created by reversing the tape on which the music was recorded. Treating the studio as special kind of performance space, Davies classifies “Rain” as a work for studio performance. Other musicians have since performed this song for an audience, but to do so they must substitute different guitar passages. According to Davies, these performances require the musicians to perform a simpler, derivate musical work, an ordinary song for performance. By distinguishing between three kinds of musical works (works for performance, works for studio performance, and works-for-playback), Davies maintains that recorded tracks of popular music seldom count as works-for-playback.

Gracyk and Kania disagree with Davies on the grounds that popular music audiences regard tracks as distinct objects of critical attention. In the same way that an audience for a live performance of a song can critically distinguish between the song and its performance (for example, recognizing a weak performance of a superior song), audiences distinguish between and critically assess songs, performances, and their recordings. As evidence, Kania notes that “cover” versions or remakes are discussed and assessed by reference to previous recordings, not simply as new recordings of familiar songs. Furthermore, because recordings have sonic properties that belong to neither songs nor their originating performances, they ought to be regarded as distinct musical works. Like electronic music, popular music tracks are ontologically thick works-for-playback. Unlike electronic art music, popular music tracks generally present the audience with a distinct, ontologically thin work that can be authentically instantiated in other recordings and in live performance. Thus, when a Beatles cover band gives a live performance of the song “Rain,” the song that is being performed is not, as Davies contends, a different work from the one that the Beatles recorded. Where Davies thinks that a work for performance has been derived from a work for studio performance, Gracyk and Kania recognize one song, “Rain,” which is the same song in either case.

This debate about the ontology of recorded tracks might seem to be a dispute over mere semantics. However, it has many implications for the aesthetics of popular music. In part, it reveals disagreement on whether a musical event can belong to multiple ontological categories at the same time. Davies thinks not; Gracyk and Kania regard this result as relatively common with recorded popular music. The debate also reveals assumptions about what counts as genuine music making. Elevating tracks to the status of full-fledged musical works implies that record producers and sound engineers are as important as songwriters and performers. This status will, in turn, complicate attributions of authorship and thus interpretation. Furthermore, treating tracks as works suggests that a great deal of popular music might be better understood by exploring its connections with film rather than with other music (Gracyk 1996, Kania).

One need not classify tracks as musical works in order to see that a great deal of popular music culture centers on recorded music. This phenomenon has consequences for philosophy of music. Although Davies and his opponents disagree on the correct analysis of these recordings, both lines of analysis imply that listening to popular music is cognitively quite complex. Contrary to stereotypes about passive reception, listening involves complex discriminations regarding multiple objects of interest. Furthermore, this debate demonstrates the incompleteness of a philosophy of music derived from reflection on the European classical tradition. Analyses of popular music must develop conceptual tools that move beyond discussion compositions and performances. For good or ill, recordings are ubiquitous in our musical culture. Philosophy of music must come to grips with its status and its role in musical culture.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Adorno, Theodor W. “On Popular Music” In Essays on Music. Ed. Richard Leppert. Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press, 2002, pp. 437-69.
    • This 1941 essay is the most accessible place to begin reading Adorno on popular music.
  • Baugh, Bruce. “Music for the Young at Heart.” The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 53:1 (1995): 81-83.
    • Responds to criticisms of his analysis of the contrast between rock music and classical music.
  • Baugh, Bruce. “Prolegomena to Any Aesthetics of Rock Music.” The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 51:1 (1993): 23-29.
    • Analysis of rock music that contrasts it with classical music in order to show that traditional music aesthetics does not adequately account for some music.
  • Baur, Michael, and Stephen Baur, eds. The Beatles and Philosophy: Nothing You Can Think That Can't Be Thunk. Chicago: Open Court, 2006.
    • Multiple essays demonstrate that a popular group can be socially progressive and philosophically insightful.
  • Bicknell, Jeanette. “Just a Song? Exploring the Aesthetics of Popular Song Performance.” The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 63:3 (2005): 261-70.
    • Sophisticated analysis of what audiences find authentic about a popular song performance.
  • Bloom, Allan. The Closing of the American Mind. New York: Simon and Schuster, 1987.
    • A much-discussed and frequently cited book on American culture, one chapter of which utilizes Plato’s philosophy of art to condemn American popular music.
  • Brown, Lee B. “Adorno’s Case Against Popular Music.” Aesthetics: A Reader in Philosophy of the Arts. 2nd ed. Ed. David Goldblatt and Lee B. Brown. Upper Saddle River: Pearson/Prentice Hall, 2005, pp. 378-85.
    • Extremely accessible introduction to Adorno’s philosophy of music.
  • Brown, Lee B. “Marsalis and Baraka: An Essay in Comparative Cultural Discourse.” Popular Music 23 (2004): 241-55.
    • Argues that major accounts of the authenticity of African-American music are burdened by a philosophically questionable essentialism.
  • Brown, Lee B. “Phonography, Rock Records, and the Ontology of Recorded Music.” The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 58:4 (2000): 361-72.
    • Criticizes, revises, and extends Gracyk’s account of recording technology in popular music.
  • Carroll, Noël. The Philosophy of Mass Art. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1998.
    • Defends the importance of thinking about mass art instead of popular art. Although it is not Carroll’s primary focus, he often discusses popular music.
  • Collingwood, R. G. The Principles of Art. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1938, reprint 1958.
    • Classic statement of the position that popular music and other popular arts are insufficiently expressive to be genuine art.
  • Cox, Renée. “A History of Music.” The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 48:4 (1990): 395-409.
    • An overview of how music has been conceptualized in the Western tradition that concludes with interesting reflections on popular music.
  • Davies, Stephen. Musical Works and Performances: A Philosophical Exploration. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2001.
    • Extremely thorough examination of the nature of musical works and their presentation in performances; takes seriously the need to address these topics in relation to popular music.
  • Davies, Stephen. “Rock versus Classical Music.” The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 57:2 (1999): 193-204.
    • Criticizes Baugh’s contrast of rock music and classical music.
  • Detels, Claire. Soft Boundaries: Re-Visioning the Arts and Aesthetics in American Education. Westport, CT: Berfin and Garvey, 1999.
    • Challenges standard disciplinary and cultural boundaries imposed on music, including boundaries between art and popular music.
  • Dewey, John. Art as Experience. New York: Minton, Balch and Co., 1934.
    • Despite its limited discussion of music, presents a non-elitist, pragmatist aesthetic that opposes the thesis of artistic autonomy.
  • Eliot, T. S. "Marie Lloyd.” Selected Prose of T. S. Eliot. Ed. Frank Kermode. New York: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich, 1976, pp. 172-74.
    • Although Eliot is regarded as an exponent of aesthetic modernism, this 1922 essay applauds the “art” of a popular music-hall singer and comedian.
  • Fisher, John Andrew. “Rock ‘n’ Recording: The Ontological Complexity of Rock Music.” Musical Works: New Directions in the Philosophy of Music. Ed. Philip Alperson. University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press, 1998, pp. 109-23.
    • Argues that rock music is distinctive in placing recordings, rather than performances or compositions, as its primary musical object.
  • Frith, Simon. Performing Rites: On the Value of Popular Music. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1996.
    • Engages with philosophical aesthetics but ultimately argues that sociology of music is the basis of all music aesthetics.
  • Gracyk, Theodore. I Wanna Be Me: Rock Music and the Politics of Identity. Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 2001.
    • Begins with an account of how popular music expresses meanings and cultural values, then analyzes and responds to controversies surrounding musical appropriation and gendered communication in popular music.
  • Gracyk, Theodore. Listening to Popular Music: Or, How I Learned to Stop Worrying and Love Led Zeppelin. Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press, 2007.
    • Analyzes aesthetic value in music and argues that popular music’s aesthetic value is a central element of its appeal.
  • Gracyk, Theodore. Rhythm and Noise: An Aesthetics of Rock. Durham: Duke University Press, 1996.
    • The opening three chapters explore the ontological and interpretive implications of rock music’s exploitation of recording technology; the remainder defends rock against a range of common criticisms, including those offered by Adorno and Bloom.
  • Gurney, Edmund. The Power of Sound. London: Smith, Elder, and Company,1880. Reprint New York: Basic Books, 1966.
    • Long article that offers important arguments against musical expression and in favor of musical autonomy.
  • Hanslick, Eduard. On the Musically Beautiful. Trans. Geoffrey Payzant. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 1986.
    • A historically influential work that emphasizes musical autonomy.
  • Howes, Frank. “A Critique of Folk, Popular, and ‘Art’ Music.” British Journal of Aesthetics 2:3 (1962): 239-48.
    • Provides an analysis of the differences between art music, folk music, and popular music and offers reasons why popular music is generally inferior to music in the other categories.
  • Irwin, William, ed. Metallica and Philosophy: A Crash Course in Brain Surgery. Malden, MA: Blackwell, 2007.
    • Multiple essays demonstrate that a popular rock band can be philosophically insightful.
  • Johnson, Julian. Who Needs Classical Music? Cultural Choice and Musical Value. New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002.
    • An articulate defense of traditional elitism that regards the classical repertoire as superior to popular music.
  • Kania, Andrew. “Making Tracks: The Ontology of Rock Music.” The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 64:4 (2006): 401-14.
    • Summarizes the debate between Davies and Gracyk about the ontology of recorded music and offers original arguments against Davies.
  • Kant, Immanuel. Critique of Judgment. Trans. Werner Pluhar. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1987. Contains Kant’s aesthetic theory.
    • Although Kant does not distinguish between art music and popular music, his theory of aesthetic judgment is an important source for the doctrines of artistic genius and autonomy that have been used against popular music.
  • Kaplan, Abraham. “The Aesthetics of the Popular Arts.” The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 24:3 (1966): 351-364.
    • Argues that popular art is essentially formulaic, and therefore of limited aesthetic value.
  • Kraut, Robert. “Why Does Jazz Matter to Aesthetic Theory?” The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 63:1 (2005): 3-15.
    • Using the example of jazz, argues that prevailing aesthetic theory pays insufficient attention to the ways that some music functions linguistically.
  • Meltzer, Richard. The Aesthetics of Rock. New York: Something Else Press, 1970.
    • The argument is free-form and not intended as serious philosophy, yet Meltzer is philosophically knowledgeable and occasionally makes connections between popular music and philosophical aesthetics.
  • Nietzsche, Friedrich. The Birth of Tragedy and The Case of Wagner. Trans. Walter Kaufmann. New York: Random House, 1967.
    • Contains both Nietzsche’s original position on European classical music and his later misgivings.
  • Porter, Carl, and Peter Vernezze, eds. Bob Dylan and Philosophy: It's Alright, Ma (I'm Only Thinking). Chicago: Open Court Publishing, 2006.
    • Multiple essays demonstrate that the work of a prominent popular songwriter and performer can be philosophically engaging.
  • Rudinow, Joel. “Race, Ethnicity, Expressive Authenticity: Can White People Sing the Blues?” The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 52:1 (1994): 127-37.
    • An important essay on white appropriation of African-American music.
  • Rudinow, Joel. “Reply to Taylor.” The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 53:3 (1995): 316-18.
    • Continuation of an exchange about the expressive authenticity of white blues performers.
  • Sartwell, Crispin. The Art of Living: Aesthetics of the Ordinary in World Spiritual Traditions. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1995.
    • Contains a chapter defending the vitality of blues and country music.
  • Shiner, Larry. The Invention of Art: A Cultural History. Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press, 2001.
    • Examines the social transformations that accompanied the modern development of the category of fine art.
  • Scruton, Roger. The Aesthetics of Music. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1997.
    • A review of all major topics in the aesthetics of music; argues, at some length, that the aesthetic inferiority of recent popular music is calamitous for Western culture.
  • Shusterman, Richard. Performing Live: Aesthetic Alternatives for the End of Art. Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press, 2000a.
    • Continues ongoing project of defending popular art; contains several essays on popular music.
  • Shusterman, Richard. “Popular Art and Entertainment Value,” in Philosophy and the Interpretation of Pop Culture. Ed. William Irwin and Jorge Gracia. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 2006: pp. 131-57.
    • Provides a historically informed analysis of the concept of entertainment as distinct from the concept of the popular.
  • Shusterman, Richard. Pragmatist Aesthetics: Living Beauty, Rethinking Art. 2nd edition. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 2000b.
    • Outlines a pragmatist aesthetic as an antidote to traditional, elitist accounts of art and collects two seminal papers on popular music.
  • Stadlen, Peter. “The Aesthetics of Popular Music.” British Journal of Aesthetics 2:4 (1962), pp. 351-61.
    • Argues that popular music is not inherently non-artistic and then concentrates on explaining why it is nonetheless so aesthetically impoverished.
  • Taylor, Paul. “Black and Blue: Response to Rudinow.” The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism53:3 (1995): 313-16.
    • Challenges Rudinow by offering a reformulated and more sophisticated criticism of white appropriations of African-American music.
  • von Appen, Ralf. “On the Aesthetics of Popular Music.” Music Therapy Today 8:1 (2007): 5-25.
    • Distinguishing among three dimensions of aesthetic experience, argues that popular music often invites the same response as does art music.
  • Wicke, Peter. Rock Music: Culture, Aesthetics and Sociology. Trans. Rachel Fogg. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990.
    • More sociology than philosophy, explores the opposition of popular and art music and suggests several major aesthetic differences.
  • Wrathall, Mark, ed. U2 and Philosophy: How to Dismantle an Atomic Band. Chicago: Open Court Press, 2006. Multiple essays demonstrate that a popular rock band can be socially progressive and philosophically insightful.
  • Young, James O. “Between Rock and a Harp Place.” The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 53:1 (1995): 78-81.
    • Criticizes Baugh’s contrast of rock music and classical music.
  • Zabel, Gary. “Adorno on Music: A Reconsideration.” The Musical Times 130:1754 (April 1989): 198-201.
    • A good starting point for those seeking a very brief introduction to Adorno.

Author Information:

Theodore Gracyk
Minnesota State University Moorhead
U. S. A.

Aristotle: Poetics

aristotleThe Poetics of Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.) is a much-disdained book. So unpoetic a soul as Aristotle's has no business speaking about such a topic, much less telling poets how to go about their business. He reduces the drama to its language, people say, and the language itself to its least poetic element, the story, and then he encourages insensitive readers like himself to subject stories to crudely moralistic readings, that reduce tragedies to the childish proportions of Aesop-fables. Strangely, though, the Poetics itself is rarely read with the kind of sensitivity its critics claim to possess, and the thing criticized is not the book Aristotle wrote but a caricature of it. Aristotle himself respected Homer so much that he personally corrected a copy of the Iliad for his student Alexander, who carried it all over the world. In his Rhetoric (III, xvi, 9), Aristotle criticizes orators who write exclusively from the intellect, rather than from the heart, in the way Sophocles makes Antigone speak. Aristotle is often thought of as a logician, but he regularly uses the adverb logikôs, logically, as a term of reproach contrasted with phusikôs, naturally or appropriately, to describe arguments made by others, or preliminary and inadequate arguments of his own. Those who take the trouble to look at the Poetics closely will find, I think, a book that treats its topic appropriately and naturally, and contains the reflections of a good reader and characteristically powerful thinker.

Table of Contents

  1. Poetry as Imitation
  2. The Character of Tragedy
  3. Tragic Catharsis
  4. Tragic Pity
  5. Tragic Fear and the Image of Humanity
  6. The Iliad, the Tempest, and Tragic Wonder
  7. Excerpts from Aristotle's Poetics
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Poetry as Imitation

The first scandal in the Poetics is the initial marking out of dramatic poetry as a form of imitation. We call the poet a creator, and are offended at the suggestion that he might be merely some sort of recording device. As the painter's eye teaches us how to look and shows us what we never saw, the dramatist presents things that never existed until he imagined them, and makes us experience worlds we could never have found the way to on our own. But Aristotle has no intention to diminish the poet, and in fact says the same thing I just said, in making the point that poetry is more philosophic than history. By imitation, Aristotle does not mean the sort of mimicry by which Aristophanes, say, finds syllables that approximate the sound of frogs. He is speaking of the imitation of action, and by action he does not mean mere happenings. Aristotle speaks extensively of praxis in the Nicomachean Ethics. It is not a word he uses loosely, and in fact his use of it in the definition of tragedy recalls the discussion in the Ethics.

Action, as Aristotle uses the word, refers only to what is deliberately chosen, and capable of finding completion in the achievement of some purpose. Animals and young children do not act in this sense, and action is not the whole of the life of any of us. The poet must have an eye for the emergence of action in human life, and a sense for the actions that are worth paying attention to. They are not present in the world in such a way that a video camera could detect them. An intelligent, feeling, shaping human soul must find them. By the same token, the action of the drama itself is not on the stage. It takes form and has its being in the imagination of the spectator. The actors speak and move and gesture, but it is the poet who speaks through them, from imagination to imagination, to present to us the thing that he has made. Because that thing he makes has the form of an action, it has to be seen and held together just as actively and attentively by us as by him. The imitation is the thing that is re-produced, in us and for us, by his art. This is a powerful kind of human communication, and the thing imitated is what defines the human realm. If no one had the power to imitate action, life might just wash over us without leaving any trace.

How do I know that Aristotle intends the imitation of action to be understood in this way? In De Anima, he distinguishes three kinds of perception (II, 6; III, 3). There is the perception of proper sensibles-colors, sounds, tastes and so on; these lie on the surfaces of things and can be mimicked directly for sense perception. But there is also perception of common sensibles, available to more than one of our senses, as shape is grasped by both sight and touch, or number by all five senses; these are distinguished by imagination, the power in us that is shared by the five senses, and in which the circular shape, for instance, is not dependent on sight or touch alone. These common sensibles can be mimicked in various ways, as when I draw a messy, meandering ridge of chalk on a blackboard, and your imagination grasps a circle. Finally, there is the perception of that of which the sensible qualities are attributes, the thing--the son of Diares, for example; it is this that we ordinarily mean by perception, and while its object always has an image in the imagination, it can only be distinguished by intellect, no°s (III,4). Skilled mimics can imitate people we know, by voice, gesture, and so on, and here already we must engage intelligence and imagination together. The dramatist imitates things more remote from the eye and ear than familiar people. Sophocles and Shakespeare, for example, imitate repentance and forgiveness, true instances of action in Aristotle's sense of the word, and we need all the human powers to recognize what these poets put before us. So the mere phrase imitation of an action is packed with meaning, available to us as soon as we ask what an action is, and how the image of such a thing might be perceived.

Aristotle does understand tragedy as a development out of the child's mimicry of animal noises, but that is in the same way that he understands philosophy as a development out of our enjoyment of sight-seeing (Metaphysics I, 1). In each of these developments there is a vast array of possible intermediate stages, but just as philosophy is the ultimate form of the innate desire to know, tragedy is considered by Aristotle the ultimate form of our innate delight in imitation. His beloved Homer saw and achieved the most important possibilities of the imitation of human action, but it was the tragedians who, refined and intensified the form of that imitation, and discovered its perfection.

2. The Character of Tragedy

A work is a tragedy, Aristotle tells us, only if it arouses pity and fear. Why does he single out these two passions? Some interpreters think he means them only as examples--pity and fear and other passions like that--but I am not among those loose constructionists. Aristotle does use a word that means passions of that sort (toiouta), but I think he does so only to indicate that pity and fear are not themselves things subject to identification with pin-point precision, but that each refers to a range of feeling. It is just the feelings in those two ranges, however, that belong to tragedy. Why? Why shouldn't some tragedy arouse pity and joy, say, and another fear and cruelty? In various places, Aristotle says that it is the mark of an educated person to know what needs explanation and what doesn't. He does not try to prove that there is such a thing as nature, or such a thing as motion, though some people deny both. Likewise, he understands the recognition of a special and powerful form of drama built around pity and fear as the beginning of an inquiry, and spends not one word justifying that restriction. We, however, can see better why he starts there by trying out a few simple alternatives.

Suppose a drama aroused pity in a powerful way, but aroused no fear at all. This is an easily recognizable dramatic form, called a tear-jerker. The name is meant to disparage this sort of drama, but why? Imagine a well written, well made play or movie that depicts the losing struggle of a likable central character. We are moved to have a good cry, and are afforded either the relief of a happy ending, or the realistic desolation of a sad one. In the one case the tension built up along the way is released within the experience of the work itself; in the other it passes off as we leave the theater, and readjust our feelings to the fact that it was, after all, only make-believe. What is wrong with that? There is always pleasure in strong emotion, and the theater is a harmless place to indulge it. We may even come out feeling good about being so compassionate. But Dostoyevski depicts a character who loves to cry in the theater, not noticing that while she wallows in her warm feelings her coach-driver is shivering outside. She has day-dreams about relieving suffering humanity, but does nothing to put that vague desire to work. If she is typical, then the tear-jerker is a dishonest form of drama, not even a harmless diversion but an encouragement to lie to oneself.

Well then, let's consider the opposite experiment, in which a drama arouses fear in a powerful way, but arouses little or no pity. This is again a readily recognizable dramatic form, called the horror story, or in a recent fashion, the mad-slasher movie. The thrill of fear is the primary object of such amusements, and the story alternates between the build-up of apprehension and the shock of violence. Again, as with the tear-jerker, it doesn't much matter whether it ends happily or with uneasiness, or even with one last shock, so indeterminate is its form. And while the tearjerker gives us an illusion of compassionate delicacy, the unrestrained shock-drama obviously has the effect of coarsening feeling. Genuine human pity could not co-exist with the so-called graphic effects these films use to keep scaring us. The attraction of this kind of amusement is again the thrill of strong feeling, and again the price of indulging the desire for that thrill may be high.

Let us consider a milder form of the drama built on arousing fear. There are stories in which fearsome things are threatened or done by characters who are in the end defeated by means similar to, or in some way equivalent to, what they dealt out. The fear is relieved in vengeance, and we feel a satisfaction that we might be inclined to call justice. To work on the level of feeling, though, justice must be understood as the exact inverse of the crime--doing to the offender the sort of thing he did or meant to do to others. The imagination of evil then becomes the measure of good, or at least of the restoration of order. The satisfaction we feel in the vicarious infliction of pain or death is nothing but a thin veil over the very feelings we mean to be punishing. This is a successful dramatic formula, arousing in us destructive desires that are fun to feel, along with the self-righteous illusion that we are really superior to the character who displays them. The playwright who makes us feel that way will probably be popular, but he is a menace.

We have looked at three kinds of non-tragedy that arouse passions in a destructive way, and we could add others. There are potentially as many kinds as there are passions and combinations of passions. That suggests that the theater is just an arena for the manipulation of passions in ways that are pleasant in the short run and at least reckless to pursue repeatedly. At worst, the drama could be seen as dealing in a kind of addiction, which it both produces and holds the only remedy for. But we have not yet tried to talk about the combination of passions characteristic of tragedy.

When we turn from the sort of examples I have given, to the acknowledged examples of tragedy, we find ourselves in a different world. The tragedians I have in mind are five: Aeschylus, Sophocles, and Euripides; Shakespeare, who differs from them only in time; and Homer, who differs from them somewhat more, in the form in which he composed, but shares with them the things that matter most. I could add other authors, such as Dostoyevski, who wrote stories of the tragic kind in much looser literary forms, but I want to keep the focus on a small number of clear paradigms.

When we look at a tragedy we find the chorus in Antigone telling us what a strange thing a human being is, that passes beyond all boundaries (lines 332 ff.), or King Lear asking if man is no more than this, a poor, bare, forked animal (III, iv, 97ff.), or Macbeth protesting to his wife "I dare do all that may become a man; who dares do more is none" (I, vii, 47-8), or Oedipus taunting Teiresias with the fact that divine art was of no use against the Sphinx, but only Oedipus' own human ingenuity (Oed. Tyr. 39098), or Agamemnon, resisting walking home on tapestries, saying to his wife "I tell you to revere me as a man, not a god" (925), or Cadmus in the Bacchae saying "I am a man, nothing more" (199), while Dionysus tells Pentheus "You do not know what you are" (506), or Patroclus telling Achilles "Peleus was not your father nor Thetis your mother, but the gray sea bore you, and the towering rocks, so hard is your heart" (Iliad XVI, 335 ). I could add more examples of this kind by the dozen, and your memories will supply others. Tragedy seems always to involve testing or finding the limits of what is human. This is no mere orgy of strong feeling, but a highly focussed way of bringing our powers to bear on the image of what is human as such. I suggest that Aristotle is right in saying that the powers which first of all bring this human image to sight for us are pity and fear.

It is obvious that the authors in our examples are not just putting things in front of us to make us cry or shiver or gasp. The feelings they arouse are subordinated to another effect. Aristotle begins by saying that tragedy arouses pity and fear in such a way as to culminate in a cleansing of those passions, the famous catharsis. The word is used by Aristotle only the once, in his preliminary definition of tragedy. I think this is because its role is taken over later in the Poetics by another, more positive, word, but the idea of catharsis is important in itself, and we should consider what it might mean.

3. Tragic Catharsis

First of all, the tragic catharsis might be a purgation. Fear can obviously be an insidious thing that undermines life and poisons it with anxiety. It would be good to flush this feeling from our systems, bring it into the open, and clear the air. This may explain the appeal of horror movies, that they redirect our fears toward something external, grotesque, and finally ridiculous, in order to puncture them. On the other hand, fear might have a secret allure, so that what we need to purge is the desire for the thrill that comes with fear. The horror movie also provides a safe way to indulge and satisfy the longing to feel afraid, and go home afterward satisfied; the desire is purged, temporarily, by being fed. Our souls are so many-headed that opposite satisfactions may be felt at the same time, but I think these two really are opposite. In the first sense of purgation, the horror movie is a kind of medicine that does its work and leaves the soul healthier, while in the second sense it is a potentially addictive drug. Either explanation may account for the popularity of these movies among teenagers, since fear is so much a fact of that time of life. For those of us who are older, the tear-jerker may have more appeal, offering a way to purge the regrets of our lives in a sentimental outpouring of pity. As with fear, this purgation too may be either medicinal or drug-like.

This idea of purgation, in its various forms, is what we usually mean when we call something cathartic. People speak of watching football, or boxing, as a catharsis of violent urges, or call a shouting match with a friend a useful catharsis of buried resentment. This is a practical purpose that drama may also serve, but it has no particular connection with beauty or truth; to be good in this purgative way, a drama has no need to be good in any other way. No one would be tempted to confuse the feeling at the end of a horror movie with what Aristotle calls "the tragic pleasure," nor to call such a movie a tragedy. But the English word catharsis does not contain everything that is in the Greek word. Let us look at other things it might mean.

Catharsis in Greek can mean purification. While purging something means getting rid of it, purifying something means getting rid of the worse or baser parts of it. It is possible that tragedy purifies the feelings themselves of fear and pity. These arise in us in crude ways, attached to all sorts of objects. Perhaps the poet educates our sensibilities, our powers to feel and be moved, by refining them and attaching them to less easily discernible objects. There is a line in The Wasteland, "I will show you fear in a handful of dust." Alfred Hitchcock once made us all feel a little shudder when we took showers. The poetic imagination is limited only by its skill, and can turn any object into a focus for any feeling. Some people turn to poetry to find delicious and exquisite new ways to feel old feelings, and consider themselves to enter in that way into a purified state. It has been argued that this sort of thing is what tragedy and the tragic pleasure are all about, but it doesn't match up with my experience. Sophocles does make me fear and pity human knowledge when I watch the Oedipus Tyrannus, but this is not a refinement of those feelings but a discovery that they belong to a surprising object. Sophocles is not training my feelings, but using them to show me something worthy of wonder.

The word catharsis drops out of the Poetics because the word wonder, to rhaumaston, replaces it, first in chapter 9, where Aristotle argues that pity and fear arise most of all where wonder does, and finally in chapters 24 and 25, where he singles out wonder as the aim of the poetic art itself, into which the aim of tragedy in particular merges. Ask yourself how you feel at the end of a tragedy. You have witnessed horrible things and felt painful feelings, but the mark of tragedy is that it brings you out the other side. Aristotle's use of the word catharsis is not a technical reference to purgation or purification but a beautiful metaphor for the peculiar tragic pleasure, the feeling of being washed or cleansed.

The tragic pleasure is a paradox. As Aristotle says, in a tragedy, a happy ending doesn't make us happy. At the end of the play the stage is often littered with bodies, and we feel cleansed by it all. Are we like Clytemnestra, who says she rejoiced when spattered by her husband's blood, like the earth in a Spring rain (Ag. 1389-92)? Are we like Iago, who has to see a beautiful life destroyed to feel better about himself (Oth. V, i, 18-20)? We all feel a certain glee in the bringing low of the mighty, but this is in no way similar to the feeling of being washed in wonderment. The closest thing I know to the feeling at the end of a tragedy is the one that comes with the sudden, unexpected appearance of something beautiful. In a famous essay on beauty (Ennead I, tractate 6), Plotinus says two things that seem true to me: "Clearly [beauty] is something detected at a first glance, something that the soul... recognizes, gives welcome to, and, in a way, fuses with" (beginning sec. 2). What is the effect on us of this recognition? Plotinus says that in every instance it is "an astonishment, a delicious wonderment" (end sec. 4). Aristotle is insistent that a tragedy must be whole and one, because only in that way can it be beautiful, while he also ascribes the superiority of tragedy over epic poetry to its greater unity and concentration (ch. 26). Tragedy is not just a dramatic form in which some works are beautiful and others not; tragedy is itself a species of beauty. All tragedies are beautiful.

By following Aristotle's lead, we have now found five marks of tragedy: (1) it imitates an action, (2) it arouses pity and fear, (3) it displays the human image as such, (4) it ends in wonder, and (5) it is inherently beautiful. We noticed earlier that it is action that characterizes the distinctively human realm, and it is reasonable that the depiction of an action might show us a human being in some definitive way, but what do pity and fear have to do with that showing? The answer is everything.

4. Tragic Pity

First, let us consider what tragic pity consists in. The word pity tends to have a bad name these days, and to imply an attitude of condescension that diminishes its object. This is not a matter of the meanings of words, or even of changing attitudes. It belongs to pity itself to be two-sided, since any feeling of empathy can be given a perverse twist by the recognition that it is not oneself but another with whom one is feeling a shared pain. One of the most empathetic characters in all literature is Edgar in King Lear. He describes himself truly as "a most poor man, made tame to fortune's blows, Who, by the art of known and feeling sorrows, Am pregnant to good pity" (IV, vi, 217-19). Two of his lines spoken to his father are powerful evidence of the insight that comes from suffering oneself and taking on the suffering of others: "Thy life's a miracle" (IV, vi, 5 5 ), he says, and "Ripeness is all" (V, ii, 11), trying to help his father see that life is still good and death is not something to be sought. Yet in the last scene of the play this same Edgar voices the stupidest words ever spoken in any tragedy, when he concludes that his father just got what he deserved when he lost his eyes, since he had once committed adultery (V, iii, 171-4). Having witnessed the play, we know that Gloucester lost his eyes because he chose to help Lear, when the kingdom had become so corrupt that his act of kindness appeared as a walking fire in a dark world (I1I, iv, 107). There is a chain of effects from Gloucester's adultery to his mutilation, but it is not a sequence that reveals the true cause of that horror. The wholeness of action that Shakespeare shapes for us shows that Gloucester's goodness, displayed in a courageous, deliberate choice, and not his weakness many years earlier, cost him his eyes. Edgar ends by giving in to the temptation to moralize, to chase after the "fatal flaw" which is no part of tragedy, and loses his capacity to see straight.

This suggests that holding on to proper pity leads to seeing straight, and that seems exactly right. But what is proper pity? There is a way of missing the mark that is opposite to condescension, and that is the excess of pity called sentimentality. There are people who use the word sentimental for any display of feeling, or any taking seriously of feeling, but their attitude is as blind as Edgar's. Sentimentality is inordinate feeling, feeling that goes beyond the source that gives rise to it. The woman in Dostoyevski's novel who loves pitying for its own sake is an example of this vice. But between Edgar's moralizing and her gushing there is a range of appropriate pity. Pity is one of the instruments by which a poet can show us what we are. We pity the loss of Gloucester's eyes because we know the value of eyes, but more deeply, we pity the violation of Gloucester's decency, and in so doing we feel the truth that without such decency, and without respect for it, there is no human life. Shakespeare is in control here, and the feeling he produces does not give way in embarrassment to moral judgment, nor does it make us wallow mindlessly in pity because it feels so good; the pity he arouses in us shows us what is precious in us, in the act of its being violated in another.

5. Tragic Fear and the Image of Humanity

Since every boundary has two sides, the human image is delineated also from the outside, the side of the things that threaten it. This is shown to us through the feeling of fear. As Aristotle says twice in the Rhetoric, what we pity in others, we fear for ourselves (1382b 26, 1386a 27). In our mounting fear that Oedipus will come to know the truth about himself, we feel that something of our own is threatened. Tragic fear, exactly like tragic pity, and either preceding it or simultaneous with it, shows us what we are and are unwilling to lose. It makes no sense to say that Oedipus' passion for truth is a flaw, since that is the very quality that makes us afraid on his behalf. Tragedy is never about flaws, and it is only the silliest of mistranslations that puts that claim in Aristotle's mouth. Tragedy is about central and indispensable human attributes, disclosed to us by the pity that draws us toward them and the fear that makes us recoil from what threatens them.

Because the suffering of the tragic figure displays the boundaries of what is human, every tragedy carries the sense of universality. Oedipus or Antigone or Lear or Othello is somehow every one of us, only more so. But the mere mention of these names makes it obvious that they are not generalized characters, but altogether particular. And if we did not feel that they were genuine individuals, they would have no power to engage our emotions. It is by their particularity that they make their marks on us, as though we had encountered them in the flesh. It is only through the particularity of our feelings that our bonds with them emerge. What we care for and cherish makes us pity them and fear for them, and thereby the reverse also happens: our feelings of pity and fear make us recognize what we care for and cherish. When the tragic figure is destroyed it is a piece of ourselves that is lost. Yet we never feel desolation at the end of a tragedy, because what is lost is also, by the very same means, found. I am not trying to make a paradox, but to describe a marvel. It is not so strange that we learn the worth of something by losing it; what is astonishing is what the tragedians are able to achieve by making use of that common experience. They lift it up into a state of wonder.

Within our small group of exemplary poetic works, there are two that do not have the tragic form, and hence do not concentrate all their power into putting us in a state of wonder, but also depict the state of wonder among their characters and contain speeches that reflect on it. They are Homer's Iliad and Shakespeare's Tempest. (Incidentally, there is an excellent small book called Woe or Wonder, the Emotional Effect of Shakespearean Tragedy, by J. V. Cunningham, that demonstrates the continuity of the traditional understanding of tragedy from Aristotle to Shakespeare.) The first poem in our literary heritage, and Shakespeare's last play, both belong to a conversation of which Aristotle's Poetics is the most prominent part.

6. The Iliad, the Tempest, and Tragic Wonder

In both the Iliad and the Tempest there are characters with arts that in some ways resemble that of the poet. It is much noticed that Prospero's farewell to his art coincides with Shakespeare's own, but it may be less obvious that Homer has put into the Iliad a partial representation of himself. But the last 150 lines of Book XVIII of the Iliad describe the making of a work of art by Hephaestus. I will not consider here what is depicted on the shield of Achilles, but only the meaning in the poem of the shield itself. In Book XVIII, Achilles has realized what mattered most to him when it is too late. The Greeks are driven back to their ships, as Achilles had prayed they would be, and know that they are lost without him. "But what pleasure is this to me now," he says to his mother, "when my beloved friend is dead, Patroclus, whom I cherished beyond all friends, as the equal of my own soul; I am bereft of him" (80-82). Those last words also mean "I have killed him." In his desolation, Achilles has at last chosen to act. "I will accept my doom," he says (115 ). Thetis goes to Hephaestus because, in spite of his resolve, Achilles has no armor in which to meet his fate. She tells her son's story, concluding "he is lying on the ground, anguishing at heart" (461). Her last word, anguishing, acheuôn, is built on Achilles' name.

Now listen to what Hephaestus says in reply: "Take courage, and do not let these things distress you in your heart. Would that I had the power to hide him far away from death and the sounds of grief when grim fate comes to him, but I can see that beautiful armor surrounds him, of such a kind that many people, one after another, who look on it, will wonder" (463-67). Is it not evident that this source of wonder that surrounds Achilles, that takes the sting from his death even in a mother's heart, is the Iliad itself? But how does the Iliad accomplish this?

Let us shift our attention for a moment to the Tempest. The character Alonso, in the power of the magician Prospero, spends the length of the play in the illusion that his son has drowned. To have him alive again, Alonso says, "I wish Myself were mudded in that oozy bed Where my son lies" (V, i, 150-2). But he has already been there for three hours in his imagination; he says earlier "my son i' th' ooze is bedded; and I'll seek him deeper than e'er plummet sounded And with him there lie mudded" (III, iii, 100-2). What is this muddy ooze? It is Alonso's grief, and his regret for exposing his son to danger, and his self-reproach for his own past crime against Prospero and Prospero's baby daughter, which made his son a just target for divine retribution; the ooze is Alonso's repentance, which feels futile to him since it only comes after he has lost the thing he cares most about. But the spirit Ariel sings a song to Alonso's son: "Full fathom five thy father lies; Of his bones are coral made; Those are pearls that were his eyes; Nothing of him that doth fade But doth suffer a sea change Into something rich and strange" (I, ii, 397-402). Alonso's grief is aroused by an illusion, an imitation of an action, but his repentance is real, and is slowly transforming him into a different man. Who is this new man? Let us take counsel from the "honest old councilor" Gonzalo, who always has the clearest sight in the play. He tells us that on this voyage, when so much seemed lost, every traveller found himself "When no man was his own" (V, i, 206-13). The something rich and strange into which Alonso changes is himself, as he was before his life took a wrong turn. Prospero's magic does no more than arrest people in a potent illusion; in his power they are "knit up In their distractions" (III, iii, 89-90). When released, he says, "they shall be themselves" (V, i, 32).

On virtually every page of the Tempest, the word wonder appears, or else some synonym for it. Miranda's name is Latin for wonder, her favorite adjective brave seems to mean both good and out-of-the-ordinary, and the combination rich and strange means the same. What is wonder? J. V. Cunningham describes it in the book I mentioned as the shocked limit of all feeling, in which fear, sorrow, and joy can all merge. There is some truth in that, but it misses what is wonderful or wondrous about wonder. It suggests that in wonder our feelings are numbed and we are left limp, wrung dry of all emotion. But wonder is itself a feeling, the one to which Miranda is always giving voice, the powerful sense that what is before one is both strange and good. Wonder does not numb the other feelings; what it does is dislodge them from their habitual moorings. The experience of wonder is the disclosure of a sight or thought or image that fits no habitual context of feeling or understanding, but grabs and holds us by a power borrowed from nothing apart from itself. The two things that Plotinus says characterize beauty, that the soul recognizes it at first glance and spontaneously gives welcome to it, equally describe the experience of wonder. The beautiful always produces wonder, if it is seen as beautiful, and the sense of wonder always sees beauty.

But are there really no wonders that are ugly? The monstrosities that used to be exhibited in circus side-shows are wonders too, are they not? In the Tempest, three characters think first of all of such spectacles when they lay eyes on Caliban (II, ii, 28-31; V, i, 263-6), but they are incapable of wonder, since they think they know everything that matters already. A fourth character in the same batch, who is drunk but not insensible, gives way at the end of Act II to the sense that this is not just someone strange and deformed, nor just a useful servant, but a brave monster. But Stephano is not like the holiday fools who pay to see monstrosities like two-headed calves or exotic sights like wild men of Borneo. I recall an aquarium somewhere in Europe that had on display an astoundingly ugly catfish. People came casually up to its tank, were startled, made noises of disgust, and turned away. Even to be arrested before such a sight feels in some way perverse and has some conflict in the feeling it arouses, as when we stare at the victims of a car wreck. The sight of the ugly or disgusting, when it is felt as such, does not have the settled repose or willing surrender that are characteristic of wonder. "Wonder is sweet," as Aristotle says.

This sweet contemplation of something outside us is exactly opposite to Alonso's painful immersion in his own remorse, but in every other respect he is a model of the spectator of a tragedy. We are in the power of another for awhile, the sight of an illusion works real and durable changes in us, we merge into something rich and strange, and what we find by being absorbed in the image of another is ourselves. As Alonso is shown a mirror of his soul by Prospero, we are shown a mirror of ourselves in Alonso, but in that mirror we see ourselves as we are not in witnessing the Tempest, but in witnessing .a tragedy. The Tempest is a beautiful play, suffused with wonder as well as with reflections on wonder, but it holds the intensity of the tragic experience at a distance. Homer, on the other hand, has pulled off a feat even more astounding than Shakespeare's, by imitating the experience of a spectator of tragedy within a story that itself works on us as a tragedy.

In Book XXIV of the Iliad, forms of the word tham bos, amazement, occur three times in three lines (482-4), when Priam suddenly appears in the hut of Achilles and "kisses the terrible man-slaughtering hands that killed his many sons" (478-9), but this is only the prelude to the true wonder. Achilles and Priam cry together, each for his own grief, as each has cried so often before, but this time a miracle happens. Achilles' grief is transformed into satisfaction, and cleansed from his chest and his hands (513-14). This is all the more remarkable, since Achilles has for days been repeatedly trying to take out his raging grief on Hector's dead body. The famous first word of the Iliad, mÍnis, wrath, has come back at the beginning of Book XXIV in the participle meneainôn (22), a constant condition that Lattimore translates well as "standing fury." But all this hardened rage evaporates in one lamentation, just because Achilles shares it with his enemy's father. Hermes had told Priam to appeal to Achilles in the names of his father, his mother, and his child, "in order to stir his heart" (466-7), but Priam's focussed misery goes straight to Achilles' heart without diluting the effect. The first words out of Priam's mouth are "remember your father" (486). Your father deserves pity, Priam says, so "pity me with him in mind, since I am more pitiful even than he; I have dared what no other mortal on earth ever dared, to stretch out my lips to the hand of the man who murdered my children" (503-4).

Achilles had been pitying Patroclus, but mainly himself, but the feeling to which Priam has directed him now is exactly the same as tragic pity. Achilles is looking at a human being who has chosen to go to the limits of what is humanly possible to search for something that matters to him. The wonder of this sight takes Achilles out of his self-pity, but back into himself as a son and as a sharer of human misery itself. All his old longings for glory and revenge fall away, since they have no place in the sight in which he is now absorbed. For the moment, the beauty of Priam's terrible action re-makes the world, and determines what matters and what doesn't. The feeling in this moment out of time is fragile, and Achilles feels it threatened by tragic fear. In the strange fusion of this scene, what Achilles fears is himself; "don't irritate me any longer now, old man," he says when Priam tries to hurry along the return of Hector's body, "don't stir up my heart in its griefs any more now, lest I not spare even you yourself' (560, 568-9). Finally, after they share a meal, they just look at each other. "Priam wondered at Achilles, at how big he was and what he was like, for he seemed equal to the gods, but Achilles wondered at Trojan Priam, looking on the worthy sight of him and hearing his story" (629-32). In the grip of wonder they do not see enemies. They see truly. They see the beauty in two men who have lost almost everything. They see a son a father should be proud of and a father a son should revere.

The action of the Iliad stretches from Achilles' deliberate choice to remove himself from the war to his deliberate choice to return Hector's body to Priam. The passion of the Iliad moves from anger through pity and fear to wonder. Priam's wonder lifts him for a moment out of the misery he is enduring, and permits him to see the cause of that misery as still something good. Achilles' wonder is similar to that of Priam, since Achilles too sees the cause of his anguish in a new light, but in his case this takes several steps. When Priam first appears in his hut, Homer compares the amazement this produces to that with which people look at a murderer who has fled from his homeland (480-84). This is a strange comparison, and it recalls the even stranger fact disclosed one book earlier that Patroclus, whom everyone speaks of as gentle and kind-hearted (esp. XVII, 670-71), who gives his life because he cannot bear to see his friends destroyed to satisfy Achilles' anger, this same Patroclus began his life as a murderer in his own country, and came to Achilles' father Peleus for a second chance at life. When Achilles remembers his father, he is remembering the man whose kindness brought Patroclus into his life, so that his tears, now for his father, now again for Patroclus (XXIV, 511-12), merge into a single grief. But the old man crying with him is a father too, and Achilles' tears encompass Priam along with Achilles' own loved ones. Finally, since Priam is crying for Hector, Achilles' grief includes Hector himself, and so it turns his earlier anguish inside out. If Priam is like Achilles' father, then Hector must come to seem to Achilles to be like a brother, or to be like himself.

Achilles cannot be brought to such a reflection by reasoning, nor do the feelings in which he has been embroiled take him in that direction. Only Priam succeeds in unlocking Achilles' heart, and he does so by an action, by kissing his hand. From the beginning of Book XVIII (23, 27, 33), Achilles' hands are referred to over and over and over, as he uses them to pour dirt on his head, to tear his hair, and to kill every Trojan he can get his hands on. Hector, who must go up against those hands, is mesmerized by them; they are like a fire, he says, and repeats it. "His hands seem like a fire" (XX, 371-2). After Priam kisses Achilles' hand, and after they cry together, Homer tells us that the desire for lamentation went out of Achilles' chest and out of his hands (XXIV, 514). His murderous, manslaughtering hands are stilled by a grief that finally has no enemy to take itself out on. When, in Book XVIII, Achilles had accepted his doom (115), it was part of a bargain; "I will lie still when I am dead," he had said, "but now I must win splendid glory" (121). But at the end of the poem, Achilles has lost interest in glory. He is no longer eaten up by the desire to be lifted above Hector and Priam, but comes to rest in just looking at them for what they are. Homer does surround Achilles in armor that takes the sting from his misery and from his approaching death, by working that misery and death into the wholeness of the Iliad. But the Iliad is, as Aristotle says, the prototype of tragedy; it is not a poem that aims at conferring glory but a poem that bestows the gift of wonder.

Like Alonso in the Tempest, Achilles ultimately finds himself. Of the two, Achilles is the closer model of the spectator of a tragedy, because Alonso plunges deep into remorse before he is brought back into the shared world. Achilles is lifted directly out of himself, into the shared world, in the act of wonder, and sees his own image in the sorrowing father in front of him. This is exactly what a tragedy does to us, and exactly what we experience in looking at Achilles. In his loss, we pity him. In his fear of himself, on Priam's behalf, we fear for him, that he might lose his new-won humanity. In his capacity to be moved by the wonder of a suffering fellow human, we wonder at him. At the end of the Iliad, as at the end of every tragedy, we are washed in the beauty of the human image, which our pity and our fear have brought to sight. The five marks of tragedy that we learned of from Aristotle's Poetics--that it imitates an action, arouses pity and fear, displays the human image as such, ends in wonder, and is inherently beautiful--give a true and powerful account of the tragic pleasure.

7. Excerpts from Aristotle's Poetics

Ch. 6 A tragedy is an imitation of an action that is serious and has a wholeness in its extent, in language that is pleasing (though in distinct ways in its different parts), enacted rather than narrated, culminating, by means of pity and fear, in the cleansing of these passions ...So tragedy is an imitation not of people, but of action, life, and happiness or unhappiness, while happiness and unhappiness have their being in activity, and come to completion not in a quality but in some sort of action ...Therefore it is deeds and the story that are the end at which tragedy aims, and in all things the end is what matters most ...So the source that governs tragedy in the way that the soul governs life is the story.

Ch. 7 An extended whole is that which has a beginning, middle and end. But a beginning is something which, in itself, does not need to be after anything else, while something else naturally is the case or comes about after it; and an end is its contrary, something which in itself is of such a nature as to be after something else, either necessarily or for the most part, but to have nothing else after it-It is therefore needful that wellput-together stories not begin from just anywhere at random, nor end just anywhere at random ...And beauty resides in size and order ...the oneness and wholeness of the beautiful thing being present all at once in contemplation stories, just as in human organizations and in living things.

Ch. 8 A story is not one, as some people think, just because it is about one person ...And Homer, just as he is distinguished in all other ways, seems to have seen this point beautifully, whether by art or by nature.

Ch. 9 Now tragedy is an imitation not only of a complete action, but also of objects of fear and pity, and these arise most of all when events happen contrary to expectation but in consequence of one another; for in this way they will have more wonder in them than if they happened by chance or by fortune, since even among things that happen by chance, the greatest sense of wonder is from those that seem to have happened by design.

Chs. 13-14 Since it is peculiar to tragedy to be an imitation of actions arousing pity and fear ...and since the former concerns someone who is undeserving of suffering and the latter concerns someone like us ...the story that works well must ...depict a change from good to bad fortune, resulting not from badness one that arises from the actions themselves, the astonishment coming about through things that are likely, as in the Oedipus of Sophocles. A revelation, as the word indicates, is a change from ignorance to knowledge, that produces either friendship or hatred in people marked out for good or bad fortune. The most beautiful of revelations occurs when reversals of condition come about at the same time, as is the case in the Oedipus.--Ch. 11

Chs. 24-5 Wonder needs to be produced in tragedies, but in the epic there is more room for that which confounds reason, by means of which wonder comes about most of all, since in the epic one does not see the person who performs the action; the events surrounding the pursuit of Hector would seem ridiculous if they were on stage ...But wonder is sweet ...And Homer most of all has taught the rest of us how one ought to speak of what is untrue ...One ought to choose likely impossibilities in preference to unconvincing possibilities ...And if a poet has, represented impossible things, then he has missed the mark, but that is the right thing to do if he thereby hits the mark that is the end of the poetic art itself, that is, if in that way he makes that or some other part more wondrous.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle, Metaphysics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Green Lion Press, 1999.
  • Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Focus Philosophical Library, Pullins Press, 2002.
  • Aristotle, On the Soul, Joe Sachs (trans.), Green Lion Press, 2001.
  • Aristotle, Poetics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Focus Philosophical Library, Pullins Press, 2006.
  • Aristotle, Physics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Rutgers U. P., 1995.

Author Information

Joe Sachs
St. John's College
U. S. A.

Ethical Criticism of Art

Traditionally, there were two opposing philosophical positions taken with respect to the legitimacy of the ethical evaluation of art: ‘moralism’ and ‘autonomism’, where moralism is the view that the aesthetic value of art should be determined by, or reduced to, its moral value, while autonomism holds that it is inappropriate to apply moral categories to art; they should be evaluated by ‘aesthetic’ standards alone. Recent work on the ethical criticism of art has proposed several new positions; more moderate versions of autonomism and moralism which lie between the two extremes described above. The issue has now become not one of whether moral evaluations of art works are appropriate, but rather, whether they should be described as aesthetic evaluations. The contemporary debate focuses on narrative art, which is seen as having unique features to which ethical criticism is particularly pertinent. Attempts have been made to simplify the issue of the ethical criticism of art by distancing peripheral issues such as causal claims about the effects of art on its audience and censorship. However, there is still considerable interest in the possibility of certain narrative artworks having the potential to play an important role in moral education. The debate over the ethical criticism of art therefore highlights some of the central reasons why we value narrative art, as well as questioning the scope, or the parameters, of our concept of the aesthetic.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Radical Autonomism and Radical Moralism
  3. Moderate Autonomism and Moderate Moralism
    1. Moderate Autonomism
    2. Moderate Moralism
    3. Moderate Autonomism vs Moderate Moralism
  4. Moderate Moralism and Ethicism
    1. Distinguishing Moderate Moralism from Ethicism
    2. Ethicism vs Moderate Moralism
  5. The Causal Thesis
    1. Literature and Moral Education
    2. Ethical Criticism and Censorship
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

'Ethical criticism' refers to the inclusion of an ethical component in the interpretation and evaluation of art. The two traditional opposing positions taken with respect to ethical criticism are 'autonomism' and 'moralism'. The former claims that ethical criticism is never legitimate since moral and aesthetic value are autonomous, while the latter reduces aesthetic value to moral value. The extreme versions of autonomism and moralism, their appeal and their flaws, are discussed in section two.

In recent years, debate over ethical criticism has resurfaced, partly through the Ethical Criticism Symposium featured in Philosophy and Literature in 1997-8, which is discussed in the final section of this article, since it bears on the consideration of the causal thesis that certain literature can have positive moral effects on its audience. A second arm of the ethical criticism debate saw several more moderate, and more plausible, positions proposed. These are 'moderate autonomism', ‘moderate moralism’ and ‘ethicism’. In this body of literature too, the focus was on narrative art. What is at issue in the current debate is whether the realm of aesthetic value should be taken to include the moral value of narrative art (a) never, (b) only sometimes when an artwork displays moral features (merits or defects), or (c) whenever an artwork displays moral features (merits or defects). Due to differences between the modes of expression and content matter of the different art forms, it seems likely that what is true of the ethical criticism of narrative art, which often deals explicitly with human affairs and morality, may not be true of abstract art forms such as music and some fine arts and dance. Such art forms would require separate consideration and this is something which has not thus far been undertaken in the philosophical literature.

Section 3 considers the debate between moderate autonomism, defended by Anderson and Dean, and Noel Carroll's moderate moralism, examining Carroll's reasons for arguing that at least sometimes the moral features of narrative artworks are also aesthetic features. Section 4 introduces Berys Gaut's 'ethicism’, and examines the contention, made primarily by Anderson and Dean, that moderate moralism and ethicism are one and the same position. This claim is shown to be false, and the two positions are clearly distinguished. Much of the recent debate over ethical criticism - that is the debate between moderate autonomism, moderate moralism and ethicism - focusses on the flaws in the specific arguments presented for moderate moralism and ethicism. In fact, the central issue in the debate over ethical criticism, which is somewhat masked by the details, is how broadly the aesthetic should be defined. While the extreme positions, radical autonomism and radical moralism define the aesthetic most narrowly, the position which defines the aesthetic most broadly and inclusively is ethicism.

2. Radical Autonomism and Radical Moralism

There are two extreme positions traditionally taken with respect to the relationship between art and morality; one is autonomism, or aestheticism, which is the view that it is inappropriate to apply moral categories to artworks, and that only aesthetic categories are relevant, while at the other end of the scale is moralism, the view that aesthetic objects should be judged wholly or centrally with respect to moral standards or values. Both autonomism and moralism are widely recognised to be problematic, as they are based on inadequate conceptions of art and aesthetic value.

Radical Moralism is the view that the aesthetic value of an artwork is determined by its moral value. The most extreme version of this position reduces all aesthetic value to moral value. Proponents of radical moralism include Tolstoy, who, arguing against definitions of art that equated art with beauty, said: "The inaccuracy of all these definitions arises from the fact that in them all ... the object considered is the pleasure art may give, and not the purpose it may serve in the life of man and of humanity." Tolstoy emphasised the moral significance of art in society as essential to the (aesthetic) value of art. Social reductionism, such as the 'popular aesthetic' endorsed by Pierre Bourdieu, Roger Taylor and others, is also a version of radical moralism. Radical moralism has been widely criticised for ignoring certain fundamental aspects of aesthetic value, such as formal features. The radical moralist will have some difficulty explaining how art can be distinguished from other cultural products, including such things as political speeches, due to their failure to include in their criteria for making judgments about aesthetic value anything that is a unique feature of art.

Autonomism and aestheticism are essentially the same position. The label 'autonomism’ captures the fact that this position holds that aesthetic value is autonomous from other kinds of value, such as moral value. The label 'aestheticism' captures the fact that the position emphasises the importance of focussing on theaesthetic, that is, the pure aesthetic, features of artworks. Pure aesthetic qualities may include formal features and beauty or, for some autonomists, formal features only. It is important to note that formalism and autonomism are not identical positions, although advocates of formalism will tend to be autonomists. Formalism, rejected earlier, is the view that the proper way to respond to art is to respond to its formal features or, in other words, that the aesthetic value of an artwork is determined solely by its formal features. A formalist, such as Clive Bell, would not include beauty as something we should respond to in art, but those formalists who do include beauty regard it as something that is determined by the formal features the artwork possesses.

"Aestheticism' is perhaps the more appropriate label for the extreme position subscribed to by the aesthete - that aesthetic value is the highest of all values. Interestingly, although the aesthete might not be interested in defending their position, any attempt to do so would likely involve appeals to moral standards; that is, they would have to give a justification for their view that one should take on a predominantly aesthetic attitude in life in terms of moral value. For example, Richard Posner, in 'Against Ethical Criticism', appears to identify himself as an aesthete, but, ironically, an aesthete who wants to provide a moral justification for his position: "The aesthetic outlook is a moral outlook, one that stresses the values of openness, detachment, hedonism, curiosity, tolerance, the cultivation of the self, and the preservation of a private sphere - in short, the values of liberal individualism."(1997, p. 2) Aestheticism, in it's most extreme form, could almost be seen as a version of radical moralism. In any case, both positions are equally reductive with respect to the scope of aesthetic value.

However, 'aestheticism' does not always refer to the extreme position, and the terms ‘autonomism’ and 'aestheticism' can be used interchangeably. Autonomism has become the predominant term used in recent literature, most likely because it does capture the notion that aesthetic value is held to be an autonomous realm of value by those who subscribe to any version of this position. Radical Autonomism is the view that the proper way to respond to art is to respond only to the pure aesthetic qualities, or what is 'in the work itself'; while to bring moral values, or other social values, to bear on art is a mistake. The radical autonomist's motto is 'art for art’s sake’. Oscar Wilde is an example of a radical autonomist. He wrote in the Preface to The Picture of Dorien Gray: " art's subject matter we should be more or less indifferent," and "Life is the solvent that breaks up art, the enemy that lays waste her house.” Wilde's statements on the topic of and and morality are those of an autonomist, although the subject matter of his own work dealt explicitly with moral issues. His position appears to have been not that literary art can't deal with moral issues as part of its subject matter, but simply that they are irrelevant to the aesthetic value of the art, and should not influence the audience's, or critic’s, aesthetic response to the work. An autonomist position such as this is based on a narrow understanding of the aesthetic value of art, which values the way in which the subject matter of such art is represented (which may include formal features and beauty), but not the subject matter itself (which may include moral features). However, autonomism, while purporting to give aesthetic value primacy, neglects many of the potential ways in which art can have aesthetic value. Such a view ignores the fact that certain art forms are culturally embedded, and, as such, are inextricably bound up with important social values, such as moral value.

Noel Carroll explains the appeal of radical autonomism with reference to the "common denominator argument"; that is, the argument that it is only those features common to all art that are the essential defining features of art, and it is only these features that should properly be regarded as being within the realm of the aesthetic. (See 'Moderate Moralism', BJA, 36:3, 1996) As Carroll points out, the fact that radical autonomists have a ready answer to the questions -What are the unique and essential features common to all art? - or - What are the defining features of art? - is a central reason for the appeal of their position. This feature of autonomism appears to provide a straightforward way of distinguishing art from non-art, as well as providing specific grounds upon which to defend the objectivity of aesthetic value. A further reason autonomism initially seems intuitive is that it is difficult to see how moral considerations could be pertinent across whole art forms, such as music, and abstract art of various kinds.(p. 226) The above reasons make radical autonomism an attractive position, but its narrow construal of the aesthetic is too narrow to adequately account for the aesthetic value of certain art forms, or particular artworks. Besides, as was discussed earlier, attempting to define art in terms of essential criteria common to all artworks is not a promising strategy; the nature of art defies such restrictions. Carroll argues that "we can challenge [the radical autonomist's] appeal to the nature of art with appeals to the natures of specific art forms or genres which, given what they are, warrant at least additional criteria of evaluation to supplement whatever the autonomist claims is the common denominator of aesthetic evaluation." (p. 227)

What Carroll specifically has in mind is the role our moral understanding plays in our appreciation of narrative art. Carroll claims that narrative artworks are always incomplete, and that a certain amount of information has to be filled in by the reader or audience in order to make the work intelligible. This includes information which must be supplied by our moral understanding. He says: " is vastly improbable that there could be any substantial narrative of human affairs, especially a narrative artwork, that did not rely upon activating the moral powers of readers, viewers and listeners. Even modernist novels that appear to eschew 'morality' typically do so in order to challenge bourgeois morality and to enlist the reader in sharing their ethical disdain for it." (p. 228) Examples of works which require the input of our moral understanding in order to make the narrative intelligible include Jane Austin's Emma, George Elliot’s Middlemarch, and (ironically) Oscar Wilde's The Picture of Dorian Gray.

3. Moderate Autonomism and Moderate Moralism

a. Moderate Autonomism

Moderate autonomism, defended by J. Anderson and J. Dean, is a more plausible position than radical autonomism; it recognises that moral merits or defects can feature in the content of certain art forms and that sometimes moral judgments of artworks are pertinent. However, moderate autonomism is still an autonomist position in the sense that it maintains that the aesthetic value and the moral value of artworks are autonomous. According to moderate autonomism: "an artwork will never be aesthetically better in virtue of its moral strengths, and will never be worse because of its moral defects. / On a strict reading of moderate autonomism, one of its decisive claims is that defective moral understanding never counts against the aesthetic merit of a work. An artwork may invite an audience to entertain a defective moral perspective and this will not detract from its aesthetic value."(Carroll, 1996, p. 232) It is this central claim that both Carroll and Gaut argue against.

b. Moderate Moralism

Moderate autonomism stands in opposition to 'Moderate moralism': "[Moderate moralism] contends that some works of art may be evaluated morally (contra radical autonomism) and that sometimes the moral defects and/or merits of a work may figure in the aesthetic evaluation of the work." (p. 236) The crucial difference between moderate autonomism and moderate moralism, then, is that while both agree that moral judgments can be legitimately made about certain artworks, moderate moralists contend that sometimes such judgments are aesthetic evaluations, while moderate autonomists hold that moral judgments about works of art are always outside the realm of the aesthetic. On the one hand, Anderson and Dean say, "some of the knowledge that art brings home to us may be moral knowledge. All this is granted when we agree that art is properly subject to moral evaluation. But why is this value aesthetic value?" (Anderson & Dean p. 160) On the other hand, Carroll says, "Moderate autonomists overlook the degree to which moral presuppositions play a structural role in the design of many artworks."(Carroll 1996 p. 233) Carroll does not suggest that this is the only way in which moral features may contribute to a work's aesthetic value; a more general account of this is described in the following section.

c. Moderate Autonomism vs Moderate Moralism

What is really at issue in the debate over ethical criticism is how broadly we define the aesthetic. But this is not simply arbitrary - what in fact are the boundaries of the aesthetic? Carroll aims to show, with reference to specific examples, that there are actual cases where a narrow construal of the aesthetic, such as the one adopted by moderate autonomists, is an inadequate way of understanding that work's aesthetic value, and an inadequate way of understanding how we appreciate such artworks qua artworks. Even if moderate moralism is not the best way to explain the moral value of narrative artworks, Carroll is wise to turn to critical analysis of actual examples to support his argument, for this is where we can most clearly see the problems with moderate autonomism.

The central argument for moderate moralism (hereafter MM) is described as the 'Common Reason Argument.' Having first argued that many narrative artworks are incomplete in ways that require us to use our moral understanding in order to comprehend the work, Carroll then argues, with reference to examples, that because of this fact about narrative artworks, it is sometimes the case that a moral defect in a work will also be an aesthetic defect since it prevents us from fully engaging with that work. In other words, Carroll argues that in some cases the reason a work is morally flawed is the same reason the work is aesthetically flawed, and so in these cases the judgment that the work is morally flawed is also an aesthetic evaluation of that work. (Anderson & Dean, 1998, pp. 156-7) Mary Devereaux's analysis ofTriumph of the Will provides an excellent example of this. (See her article 'Beauty and Evil' in Levinson,Aesthetics & Ethics, 1998). According to Devereaux, Triumph of the Will is morally problematic because it presents the Nazi regime as appealing. Although a morally sensitive audience might be able to appreciate some of the formal features exhibited in the film, such as the innovative camera work, such an audience would be unable to fully engage with the film due to an inability to accept the film's central vision, that is, the glorification of Hitler and the Nazi regime. If the audience is unable to fully engage with the film's central vision, this, according to Carroll's MM, will count as an aesthetic defect in the film (because the magnitude of our aesthetic experience will be limited by our inability to fully engage with the film's central theme). So, the very feature that makes the film morally defective is also one of most significant aesthetic defects in the film. Hence, the moral defectiveness and the aesthetic defectiveness are due to a common reason in this particular case.

In their argument against MM, Anderson and Dean construct two arguments, a 'moral defect argument' and an 'aesthetic defect argument', which, together, they take to represent the ‘common reason argument.’ The two arguments are presented as follows:

The Moral Defect Argument

  1. The perspective of the work in question is immoral.
  2. Therefore, the work 'invites us to share [this morally] defective perspective' (In one case we are invited to find an evil person sympathetic; in the other case, we are invited to find gruesome acts humorous.)
  3. Any work which invites us to share a morally defective perspective is, itself, morally defective.
  4. Therefore, the work in question is morally defective

The Aesthetic Defect Argument

  1. The perspective of the work in question is immoral.
  2. The immorality portrayed subverts the possibility of uptake. (In the case of the tragedy, the response of pity is precluded; in the case of the satire the savouring of parody is precluded.)
  3. Any work which subverts its own genre is aesthetically defective.
  4. Therefore, the work in question is aesthetically defective. (pp. 156-7)

Anderson and Dean focus their objection to MM on the fact that the one premise the moral defect argument and the aesthetic defect argument share (1) is not sufficient to establish either moral defectiveness or aesthetic defectiveness.(p. 157) This may be so, but Carroll responds to this by pointing out the common reason doesn't need to be a sufficient reason. There may be other reasons that contribute to both the aesthetic evaluation and the moral evaluation of artworks, but in some cases these two groups of reasons overlap; where a reason is common to both groups, and is a central, if not sufficient, reason for both the conclusion that a work is morally defective, and the conclusion that the work is aesthetically defective. As Carroll puts it in his response to Anderson and Dean:

But why suppose that the relevant sense of reason here is sufficient reason? Admittedly a number of factors will contribute to the moral defectiveness and the aesthetic defectiveness of the work in question. The moderate moralist need only contend that among the complex of factors that account for the moral defectiveness of the artwork in question, on the one hand, and the complex of factors that explain the aesthetic defectiveness of the artwork, on the other hand, the evil perspective of the artwork will play a central, though perhaps not sufficient, explanatory role in both. (Carroll, 1998a, p423)

Carroll's response to Anderson and Dean’s objection is convincing. There seems no reason to object to MM simply because the common reason shared the aesthetic defect argument and the moral defect argument is not a sufficient reason in either case.

Anderson and Dean eschew specific examples in their defense of MA, saying: 'because of the complexity of particular cases, we have taken pains not to rest our case on the examination of them." (A&D, 1998, p. 164). Since MM holds that moral judgments about artworks can be aesthetic evaluations in some cases, it is only necessary to show that the reason a work is morally defective is the same as the reason that work is aesthetically defective in a few actual cases in order to support MM. Carroll does give us some convincing examples, and Anderson and Dean do not show why Carroll is wrong in these particular cases. Given that there are at least some cases, such as Devereaux's analysis of Triumph of the Will, in which it has been convincingly shown that the reason a work is morally meritorious or defective is the same reason that work is aesthetically meritorious or defective, it follows that moderate autonomism is false.

4. Moderate Moralism and Ethicism

a. Distinguishing Moderate Moralism from Ethicism

As previously mentioned, 'moderate moralism' holds that: "some works of art may be evaluated morally (contra radical autonomism) and that sometimes themoral defects and/or merits of a work may figure in the aesthetic evaluation of the work." (Carroll, 1996, p. 236, my italics) 'Ethicism' holds that: "the ethical assessment of attitudes manifested by works of art is a legitimate aspect of the aesthetic evaluation of those works, such that, if a work manifests ethically reprehensible attitudes, it is to that extent aesthetically defective, and if a work manifest ethically commendable attitudes, it is to that extent aesthetically meritorious." (See Berys Gaut's 'The Ethical Criticism of Art' in Levinson, 1998, p. 182)

Anderson and Dean claim that MM and ethicism are 'similar, if not identical' (A&D, 1998, p. 157). They must mean that the positions are similar or identical in terms of scope, since Carroll and Gaut's arguments clearly differ in detail. However, they are incorrect about this. The inclusion of 'sometimes' in Carroll’s statement of his position indicates that MM is a weaker position than ethicism - since there is no such qualification in Gaut's statement of ethicism. As Carroll himself says, in his reply to Anderson and Dean: " case is more limited in scope than Gaut's. Gaut seems willing to consider virtually every moral defect in a work of art an aesthetic defect, whereas I defend a far weaker claim - namely that sometimes a moral defect in an artwork can count as an aesthetic defect..." (Carroll, 1998a p. 419)

If we look at Gaut's arguments for ethicism, it is clear how ethicism differs from MM in scope, as well as simply in detail. The argument for ethicism runs as follows (this is taken directly from "The Ethical Criticism of Art," but I have numbered each step in the argument):

  1. A work's manifestation of an attitude is a matter of the work’s prescribing certain responses toward the events described.
  2. If those responses are unmerited, because unethical, we have reason not to respond in the way prescribed.
  3. Our having reason not to respond in the way prescribed is a failure of the work.
  4. What responses the work prescribes is of aesthetic relevance.
  5. So the fact that we have reason not to respond in the way prescribed is an aesthetic failure of the work, that is to say, is an aesthetic defect.
  6. So a work's manifestation of ethically bad attitudes is an aesthetic defect in it.
  7. Mutatis mutandis, a parallel argument shows that a work's manifestation of ethically commendable attitudes is an aesthetic merit in it, since we have reason to adopt a prescribed response that is ethically commendable.
  8. So Ethicism is true. (Gaut, in Levinson, 2000, pp. 195-6)

Notice that this argument, in particular step (2), commit Gaut to the thesis that whenever a narrative artwork displays moral features, either merits or defects, these will always impact on the aesthetic value of that work to some degree. Certain flaws in Gaut's argument have been identified by Anderson and Dean and by Carroll. The most significant of these will be examined a little later.

Early in his article, Gaut explicitly outlines the scope of ethicism. It is important to note that "ethicism does not entail the casual thesis that good art ethically improves people," nor the reverse claim; that bad art corrupts.(p. 184) Gaut describes "the ethicist principle [as] a pro tanto one: it holds that a work is aesthetically meritorious (or defective) insofar as it manifests ethically admirable (or reprehensible) attitudes. (The claim could also be put like this: manifesting ethically admirable attitudes counts towardthe aesthetic merit of a work, and manifesting ethically reprehensible attitudes counts against its aesthetic merit.) (p. 182) There is an additional qualification, that, "the ethicist does not hold that manifesting ethically commendable attitudes is a necessary condition for a work to be aesthetically good: there can be good, even great, works of art that are ethically flawed. . . .Nor does the ethicist thesis hold that manifesting ethically good attitudes is a sufficient condition for a work to be aesthetically good." (pp. 182-3) Gaut explains that "the ethicist can deny these necessity and sufficiency claims, because she holds that there are a plurality of aesthetic values, of which the ethical values of artworks are but a single kind," and he suggests "we ... need to make an all-things-considered judgment, balancing these aesthetic merits and demerits against one another to determine whether the work is, all things considered, good."(p. 183) It is these features of ethicism - its recognition of a plurality of aesthetic qualities of which moral features are one kind and its commitment to an all-things-considered judgment of aesthetic value - which make ethicism a better way of understanding how the moral features of artworks impact on their aesthetic value than MM. Ethicism does not claim that every artwork, or even every narrative artwork, does contain moral features, only that when they do, these impact on the aesthetic value of the works to some extent.

As previously noted, not only do the arguments for MM and ethicism differ in scope, but they also differ in detail; and in the detail of each arguments there are possible flaws. A possible difficulty with MM - a difficulty that Oliver Conolly identifies - lies in its reliance on the notion of an'ideal', or ‘morally sensitive' audience - the normative element in MM. (See Conolly, 'Ethicism & Moderate Moralism, BJA, 40:3, 2000)

Carroll wants to make clear that his 'ideal sensitive viewer' is not one who simply makes "whatever the work has to offer inaccessible to himself because it at first offends their moral sensibilities". He explains that "the reluctance that the moderate moralist has in mind is not that the ideally sensitive audience member voluntarily puts on the brakes; rather, it is that he can't depress the accelerator because it is jammed. He tries, but fails. And he fails because there is something wrong with the structure of the artwork. It has not been designed properly on its own terms." (Carroll, 2000, p. 378) This appears to avoid the objection that 'morally sensitive audiences' will simply impose their own moral views on artworks. However, even with this clarification, the notion of an'ideal' or, ‘morally sensitive’, audience still seems problematic.

b. Ethicism vs Moderate Moralism

Conolly suggests that there are four possible interpretations of MM; Optimistic Instrumental MM, Ideal-Spectator Instrumental MM, Standard Instrumental MM and Standard Intrinsic MM. According to Optimistic Instrumental MM, "moral virtues always happen to lead to greater audience-absorption, owing to a uniformly moral audience."(Conolly, 2000, p. 308) This interpretation of MM is not only far too optimistic, but also explicitly rejected by Carroll, who distinguishes his 'morally sensitive audiences' from actual audiences, saying, "sometimes actual audiences may fail to be deterred by a moral defect in a work because, given the circumstances, they are not as morally sensitive as they should be..."(Carroll, 2000 p. 378) He gives the example of an audience during the midst of war. This clarification also avoids the problem of explaining the moral and aesthetic value of artworks simply in terms of popular opinion. Hence, the appeal to the normative notion of an ideal audience, rather than actual audiences avoids relativism. However, Conolly points out that MM's reliance on this normative element leads to a collapse of MM into ethicism. According to Ideal Spectator MM, "[i]f only ideally moral audiences count, then ... it follows that all moral virtues / defects are also aesthetic virtues / defects." (Conolly, 2000, p. 306) Conolly explains that "[t]his is because 'morally sensitive audiences' will always react favourably to moral virtue and unfavourably to moral vice. That, one takes it, is what makes them morally sensitive."(p. 306) Conolly goes on to argue that the two other possible interpretations of MM are wrong, but I will not follow him there. The central point is that, to the extent that it relies on the notion of the ideal audience, MM collapses into ethicism, because in actual fact moral features (merits or defects) will always be aesthetic features also (merits or defects). However, it should be noted that MM's reliance on 'ideal’ or ‘morally sensitive’ audiences means that Carroll doesn't specify particular criteria upon which to base judgments about the moral defectiveness or moral virtue of artworks, but his position is compatible with such criteria, which would render the ideal audience redundant.

However, although there are valuable aspects to MM - in particular, the common reason argument has its merits - it nevertheless seems more plausible to claim, as the ethicist does, that the moral features of narrative artworks are always aesthetically relevant, i.e. they are always also aesthetic features in the sense that they impact to some degree on the overall aesthetic value of those works. One reason for this is that since MM states that moral features will only sometimes also be aesthetic features, there must be some moral features of artworks that are not aesthetically relevant, whereas no such category is required by ethicism. Carroll never explains what would distinguish a case in which moral features were aesthetically relevant from a case in which they weren't - it seems only to be a question of degree - and I suggest that it makes more sense to simply say that moral features can impact on aesthetic value to varying degrees.

I have previously mentioned that MM is more limited in scope than ethicism. Although he is not unsympathetic to Gaut's view, Carroll attempts to show that ethicism is harder to defend than MM. Carroll claims that there is a problem with what exactly is built into the notion of an unmerited response. He says that according to ethicism "[a]ll immoral responses are alleged to be unmerited in a way that is relevant to aesthetic response."(Carroll, 2000 p. 375) But Carroll questions this assumption by drawing an analogy with immoral humour. He argues: "if the ethicist means by 'unmerited' “unwarranted," then the claim with respect to artworks that all prescribed, though immoral, responses are unmerited is false, since, like a joke, the structure and content of an artwork may warrant a prescribed response that is immoral. On the other hand, if the ethicist protests that by (aesthetically) 'unmerited' he means to include "morally unmerited," then he can be charged with begging the question."(p. 376) So, Carroll concludes, the 'merited response argument' can be criticised on the grounds that "not all ethically unmerited responses to artworks are unmerited aesthetically."(p. 376) This objection can be challenged on Carroll's own terms, since ideally moral audiences presumably would not find an immoral joke (for instance a racist joke) amusing, any more than they would find Triumph of the Will engaging, it can also be challenged on the grounds that laughing at a joke is not the same thing as judging an artwork to have high aesthetic value. Sometimes we laugh at 'bad jokes', such as pathetic puns, even while we recognise them as such. Likewise, we might be entertained by a 'bad film', such as ‘Revenge of the Killer Tomatoes’ or ‘Girl On a Motorcycle’, or other such cult films, while recognising it as such all the while.

5. The Causal Thesis

While much of the recent research on ethical criticism has wrangled over what should and should not count as an aesthetic feature, a more commonplace concern about literary, or narrative, art and morality would be concerned with the possible effects those works might have on their audiences. For example, the popular Ben Elton novel Popcorn is a black comedy dealing with the issue of the effects of violent films portraying killers as attractive and powerful. However, it is desirable to keep causal claims about the harmful or 'edifying' effects of art at a distance when discussing the aesthetic relevance of the moral features of literary artworks. One of the main objections to ethical criticism made by radical autonomists is the anti-consequentialist objection that there is no evidence for causal claims about either the harmful or edifying effects of art. However, this objection assumes that ethical criticism is consequentialist, whereas it needn't be at all. (A consequentialist version of ethical criticism would hold that the moral value of artworks, or certain artworks, was determined by that work's actual effects on its audience. An expectational-consequentialist version of ethical criticism would hold that the moral value of art is determined by its likely effects on its audience.) If one rejects a consequentialist, or expectational-consequentialist, account of the moral value of art, then consideration of the effects (actual or likely) of literary artworks is a only matter for further consideration once the question of a work's moral status has been decided; it is not relevant to the judgment of that work's moral status. More work could certainly be done on the effects of artworks, however it is an area where empirical research would be required, and this is another reason causal claims have not figured highly in recent work on ethical criticism, although it should be mentioned that there is an imbalance is the extent to which positive and negative causal claims about the effects of narrative art have featured in this research.

Hence, it comes as no surprise that many of those who attempt to defend ethical criticism distance themselves from the causal thesis that morally bad art corrupts, and its counterpart, that art with high moral value morally improves its audience. Although most advocates of ethical criticism successfully avoid the negative causal thesis that bad art corrupts, many do in fact defend a version of the positive causal thesis that good art morally improves its audience. Thus, the negative thesis is avoided more assiduously than the positive, and the positive causal thesis has been more thoroughly developed. I think there are two main reasons for this. The first is that the negative thesis is not only more difficult to prove conceptually, but work in this area leads to fears about censorship of works deemed harmful. As discussed later, this fear need not preclude research on the negative effects of artworks, as the discovery that a work can have negative, or even harmful, effects on its audience does not necessarily entail that it should be censored. Another reason for the imbalance between the two sides of the causal thesis is that the positive causal thesis is more obviously relevant to discussions of the role, and value, of art in society.

It should be remembered that both the positive and negative sides of the causal thesis comprise a set of claims varying in degree. The strongest causal claims about art would be that bad art always corrupts its audience, while good art always brings about moral improvement; but any thesis this strong is intuitively implausible, and would be difficult to prove. The theses that bad art has the capacity to encourage immoral behaviour or attitudes in its audience, and that good art has the capacity to play an important role in our moral education (with the implication that these capacities may go unrealised) are rather more plausible. Martha Nussbaum has been the strongest advocate of the latter, while the former has not, to my knowledge, yet been fully explored. The following sub-section considers Nussbaum's contribution to the ethical criticism debate, in particular with respect to the role that realist literature can play in moral education.

a. Literature and Moral Education

The 'Ethical Criticism Symposium', is a debate which took place, mostly within two issues of Philosophy and Literature, (Volumes 21-22) between Richard Posner on the one hand, who argued vehemently against the legitimacy of ethical criticism, and Martha Nussbaum and Wayne Booth on the other, who defended ethical criticism. Posner has already been introduced, and identified as at least a radical autonomist, and probably an extreme autonomist / aestheticist, or in other words, an aesthete. Against those who engage in ethical criticism, with a particular focus on Martha Nussbaum and Wayne Booth, Posner employs three of the most common objections to ethical criticism: autonomism / aestheticism, cognitive triviality and anti-consequentialism. However, Posner's arguments rely on a narrow understanding of the ways in which literature can manifest moral features, and I will argue here that a broader moral context, such as that explicated in Nussbaum's work on morality and literature, makes her claims about the moral value of literature plausible. Posner's narrow understanding of moral knowledge and moral education mean that his criticisms of Nussbaum miss their mark. Nussbaum could be described as a moderate moralist (although her position is also compatible with ethicism) for although she never explicitly argues for MM, she makes two claims in her article "Exactly and Responsibly: A Defense of Ethical criticism", in which her views are strikingly similar to Carroll's 'Common Reason Argument’:

  • "Consider Booth's marvelous critique of Peter Benchley’s novel Jaws ... Booth records his critique as a moral evaluation of Benchley. But isn't it just these features of the text - its superficiality, its human barrenness, its formulaic use of persons as objects - that one would mention in an aesthetic critique?"
  • "I suggest that in general and for the most part, and only where novels are concerned, we find aesthetically pleasing only works that treat human beings as humans and not just animals or objects, that contain what I have called respect before the soul. But this quality is also moral, so we might say that in the novel aesthetic interest and moral interest are not altogether unrelated." (Nussbaum, 1998, p. 357) Carroll's overview of ethical criticism also suggests some ways of responding to the sort of objections to ethical criticism made by Posner.

Some of the main arguments against radical autonomism were presented earlier, and the position was shown to be an inadequate way of understanding aesthetic value, particularly the aesthetic value of literary art. Nussbaum, however, criticizes Posner's autonomist position on more specific grounds, claiming:

Nor, it turns out, does Posner himself consistently hold the aesthetic-detachment position. Indeed, the role he imputes to literature in human life is clearly a moral one in my sense . . . Literature, he says, 'helps us make sense of our lives, helps us to fashion an identity for ourselves.' Reading a poem of Donne, he continues, won't persuade someone who never thought about love that love is the most important thing in the world. But it may 'make you realize that this is what you think, and so may serve to clarify yourself to yourself.' That, of course, is what I have been saying all along. (p359)

Nussbaum is right to point out the inconsistency. As with the rather ironic quotation, in which Posner provides a moral justification for an extreme aestheticism (see section two), there are times when he uses moral discourse in his analysis of the aesthetic value of a work of literature - only he doesn't seem to recognise it as such. There appear to be two main reasons why Posner objects so strongly to ethical criticism, and especially to Nussbaum's employment of it. First, Posner’s understanding of ethics is very much a traditional 'justice ethics', and thus he is already at odds with Nussbaum, who’s understanding of ethics is somewhat broader. She says:

One can think of works of art which can be contemplated reasonably well without asking any urgent questions about how one should live. Abstract formalist paintings are sometimes of this character, and some intricate but non-programmatic works of music (though by no means all). But it seems highly unlikely that a responsive reading of any complex literary work is utterly detached from concerns about time and death, about pain and the transcendence of pain, and so on -- all the material of 'how one should live' questions as I have conceived it. Thus, even with regard to works I don't talk about at all -- poetic dramas, lyric poems, novels by novelists very different from Dickens and James -- the aesthetic-detachment thesis is implausible if we use 'ethical' and ‘moral’ in the broad sense that I have consistently and explicitly given it. (Nussbaum, 1998, p. 358)

Nussbaum's understanding of morality is informed not only by Aristotle, but also by Iris Murdoch’s work, and by the insights of feminist moral philosophy.

Nussbaum's main concern is with moral philosophy, and her interest in ethical criticism appears to stem from the desire to show the value and usefulness of a particular selection of literature to moral philosophy, and to the development of important moral skills. Thus, her perspective on ethical criticism differs from that of anyone who is approaching the topic with a central focus on aesthetics. However, Nussbaum recognises that literature can have many different purposes (1998 p. 347); she is merely pursuing one avenue. Among her responses to Posner's criticisms, she makes explicit her specific purposes in the two books to which he refers:

Posner's attack is directed at two very different works: Love’s Knowledge, where my primary concern is with moral philosophy, and with the claim that moral philosophy needs certain carefully selected works of narrative literature in order to pursue its own task in a complete way; and Poetic Justice, where my concern is with the conduct of public deliberations in democracy, and where my claim is that literature of a carefully specified sort can offer valuable assistance to such deliberations by both cultivating and reinforcing valuable moral abilities. In neither work do I make any general claims about 'literature' as such; indeed, I explicitly eschew such claims in both works, and I insist that my argument is confined to a narrow group of pre-selected works . . . (1998 p. 346)

Nussbaum goes so far as to say that is her contention that, "certain novels are, irreplaceably, works of moral philosophy. But I shall go further … the novel can be a paradigm of moral activity." (1987 p. 170) Nussbaum's central purposes for her selected literature are to demonstrate that this literature has a place amongst moral philosophy, and to argue that such literature has important role in moral education due to its capacity to help develop certain moral abilities.

Posner objects to the idea that literature should be used or interpreted as an extension of moral philosophy, and that it can contribute to moral education. There are two main objections; the first is that literature is not a unique or particularly good source of moral knowledge, the second that there is no evidence to suggest that certain literature can morally improve its audience. With reference to the former, Posner argues:

There is neither evidence nor a theoretical reason for a belief that literature provides a straighter path to knowledge about man and society than other sources of such knowledge, including writings in other fields, such as history and science, and interactions with real people. Some people prefer to get their knowledge of human nature from novels, but it doesn't follow that novels are a superior source of such knowledge to life and to the various genres of nonfiction. (Posner, 1997, p. 10)

This objection is characteristic of those Carroll describes as arguments from cognitive triviality. (Carroll, 2000, pp. 353-355) The two main claims that make up this objection are; first, that "the moral theses associated with artworks are usually in the nature of truisms," which "would hardly count as moral discoveries."(Carroll, 2000, p. 354) And secondly, the claim made explicitly by Posner (above), that the knowledge (in this case, moral knowledge), imparted by artworks is not superior to (and some object that it is actually inferior to) that imparted by moral philosophy and the sciences. As Carroll notes, one way of countering this objection:

. . . is to claim that the model of knowledge employed by the skeptic is too narrow. The skeptic, albeit encouraged by the apparent practice of many ethical critics, thinks that the knowledge that is relevant to ethical criticism takes the form of propositions -- propositions such as 'that hypocrisy is noxious' -- and goes on to say that where such propositions are abstractable from artworks they are generally overwhelmingly trivial. But some ethical critics counter that there are more forms of knowledge than 'knowledge that.' (p. 361)

As an alternative to this narrow approach to the way in which literature may be morally informative, Carroll proposes the 'acquaintance approach' as an alternative, which is best summed up in the following paragraph:

It is one thing to be told that roadways in Mumbai are massively overcrowded, it is another thing to be given a detailed description full of illustrative incidents, emotively and perceptively portrayed. The first presents the fact: the second suggests the flavour. The first tells you that the streets are congested: the second gives a sense of what that congestion is like. The ethical critic, or at least some ethical critics, then, answer skeptics by first agreeing that the propositional knowledge available in art is often trivial or platitudinous; art is not competitive with science, philosophy, history, or even much journalism in supplying 'knowledge that.' But this is not the only type of knowledge there is. There is also 'knowledge of what such and such would be like.' . . . Moreover, this kind of knowledge is especially relevant for moral reasoning. In entertaining alternative courses of action, there is a place for the imagination. (p. 362)

This is a promising strategy, and one that is consistent with Nussbaum's views. Nussbaum, again drawing on Henry James, tells us that moral knowledge restricted to propositions would be incomplete, what is needed is a broader understanding of moral knowledge: "Moral knowledge, James suggests, is not simply intellectual grasp of propositions; it is not even simply intellectual grasp of particular facts; it is perception, It is seeing a complex, concrete reality in a highly lucid and richly responsive way; it is taking in what is there, with imagination and feeling." (Nussbaum, 1987 p. 174)

Nussbaum's views are informed by the views of Iris Murdoch, as well as James, and one of the important features of Murdoch's work Nussbaum draws on is the notion that our inner lives, our perceptions, self-awareness and so on, can be moral achievements. Speaking of Maggie, a character in James' The Golden Bowl, Nussbaum says, "Her perceptions are necessary to her effort to give him up and to preserve his dignity. They are also moral achievements in their own right: expressions of love, protections of the loved, creations of a new and richer bond between them." (p. 175)) The artistic conventions and stylistic devices available to the literary artist make it possible to represent our inner lives in a very full and realistic way, through the engagement of the audiences' imaginations. Nussbaum suggests that there are some morally relevant aspects of our inner lives that can only be represented accurately through artistic representation:

I have said that these picturings, describings, feelings and communications -- actions in their own right -- have a moral value that is not reducible to that of the overt acts they engender. I have begun, on this basis, to build a case for saying that the morally valuable aspects of this exchange [between Maggie and Adam] could not be captured in a summary or paraphrase. Now I shall begin to close the gap between action and description from the other side, showing that a responsible action, as James conceives it, is a highly context-specific and nuanced and responsive thing whose rightness could not be captured in a description that fell short of the artistic. (1987 p. 176)

Thus, objections to the idea that literature can play an important role in moral education which are based on claims of cognitive-triviality are based on too narrow an understanding of moral knowledge. As Carroll argues, it is quite plausible to suppose that there are types of moral knowledge other than those which fall within a propositional model. Accounts of morality such as those proposed by Murdoch and Nussbaum, which emphasis the importance of our inner lives, provide obvious morally relevant subject matter, for which artistic representation is a highly appropriate means of communication.

However, the causal thesis Nussbaum proposes, that certain literature can help us to develop moral abilities, has not yet been fully defended here. Posner especially objects to the proposal that literature can morally improve its audience. His three main anti-consequentialist objections are; the importance of a good upbringing, literature loving Nazi's and English professors who are no more moral than anyone else. (Posner, 1997 pp. 4-5) Nussbaum responds to this by clarifying the scope of her claims about the positive effects of literature, pointing out that:

I am fully in agreement with Posner that the phenomenon he designates as 'empathy' is not sufficient to motivate good action; I never suggest that it is, and early in Poetic Justice I insist that empathy is likely to be hooked up with compassion in someone who has had a good early education in childhood, one that teaches concern for others. (Nussbaum, 1998 p. 352)

And, with respect to the latter two points:

Booth and I are talking about the interaction between novel and mind during the time of reading. We do not claim that this part of one's life invariably dominates, although we do think that if the novels are ethically good it will have a good influence, other things equal; nor do we claim that spending more time reading novels will make it more likely that this part will dominate. Moreover, reading can only have the good effects we claim for it if one reads with immersion, not just as a painful duty. (1998 p. 353)

Having thus clarified that hers is a moderate causal thesis about the possible positive effects of morally commendable literature, as one among many influences, Nussbaum's position seems to stand up to Posner’s objections quite well. She only says that such literature can have morally beneficial effects, not that it will. Posner's objections are not good ones; literature may have the capacity to aid in the moral education of those who are already predisposed to learn what literature specifically has to offer, but this does not mean that this capacity will always be realised. A novel's full potential may not be realised all that often in ways other than the audience's failure to see its full moral import; the novel’s fine stylistic features may also go unappreciated by many readers.

It now remains to consider the specific ways in which literature may morally educate. Carroll has some suggestions, which he collects under the heading, 'the cultivation approach'. He explains that a further response to a skeptic such as Posner would be to:

...maintain that the skeptic's conception of education is too narrow. For the skeptic, education is the acquisition of insightful propositions about the moral life. For the advocate of the cultivation approach, education may also involve other things, including the honing of ethically relevant skills and powers (such as the capacity for finer perceptual discrimination, the imagination, the emotions, and the overall ability to conduct moral reflection) as well as the exercise and refinement of moral understanding (that is, the improvement and sometimes the expansion of our understanding of the moral precepts and concepts we already possess). As the label for this approach indicates, the educative value of art resides in its potential to cultivate our moral talents. (Carroll, 2000, p. 367)

This is clearly in keeping with Nussbaum's sentiments regarding the value of literature to moral education. What is required to make this causal thesis plausible is a departure from rigid views of the realms of aesthetics, morality and education. Rather, an account such as Nussbaum's, which emphasises those important aspects of moral education which Carroll summarizes above, finds the common ground between ethics, education and literature.

It turns out that Posner's criticisms of Nussbaum’s position are based on an understanding of morality, and moral education, which is too narrow. Posner's conception of the aesthetic, and the value of art, is also too narrow; so narrow in fact that it misses some of the central reasons why we value literary art. Rather, it may be that the moral value of literary artworks is just one feature among many contributing to their overall aesthetic value, within a broad conception of the aesthetic, such as that proposed by Gaut's ethicism. Nussbaum does not discuss what other aesthetic features might be relevant to an 'all-things-considered' judgment of aesthetic value, because it is not relevant to her primary interest. It is true that she takes certain literary works and uses them for a specific purpose which focuses on just one aspect of the whole aesthetic value of those works, but she says in her defense:

It is, of course, true that ethical and political considerations have played, and continue to play, a central role in my own literary projects. But one should not infer from this that I believe this is the only legitimate way of approaching literature -- any more than one would rightly infer from the fact that a person makes a career of playing the clarinet that this person thinks the flute an instrument not worth playing. . . . In short . . . I am a pluralist about literary approaches, holding that there are many that deserve to be respected and fostered. (1998 p. 347)

Certainly this seems a healthy attitude. Respecting approaches to literature which have a specific purpose, such as Nussbaum's work on the usefulness of literature to moral philosophy and moral development, can help us gain a more comprehensive understanding of the various reasons for which we value literary art, and the artists who create it.

b. Ethical Criticism and Censorship

Unfortunately, censorship decisions are often seen as being closely linked to judgments about the moral value of art. Censorship which restricts those art and entertainment objects available to us due to the imposition of a strict and rigid moral code is one of the great fears of the radical autonomist. However, the link between the moral value of artworks and censorship is often overemphasised. Although the ability to make judgments about the moral value, or perhaps even the effects of artworks, would sometimes be pertinent to informed, responsible decisions about censorship, judgments about the moral value, or effects, of artworks are neither sufficient nor necessary grounds upon which to base censorship decisions, since there are other relevant, and important, considerations.

To begin with, it has been maintained above that to judge a literary artwork as being morally problematic is not equivalent to judging that that work will have, or even could have, a corrupting influence on its audience; claims about the negative moral effects of artworks require a further step. As discussed earlier, causal claims about the effects of artworks, especially negative causal claims, are difficult to prove. But even if it could be shown that a particular artwork had the potential to corrupt audience members, it still does not automatically follow that that work should be censored.

There are, of course, issues of rights at stake; for instance the artist's right to the freedom of expression, and the (mature) audience's right to 'make up their own minds’ about the value of particular works, as opposed to the public's 'right’ to be protected from corrupting influences and/or obscenity. There is a large body of literature which deals with the possible effects of pornography on society (this appears to have been researched far more than the possible immoral effects of artworks), on what exactly constitutes obscenity, and on issues of competing rights and responsibilities relevant to censorship. When one reviews the extent of this literature, it becomes clear that there are a great many issues to be considered with respect to censorship, of which the moral value of artworks is but one.

In fact, it is possible for partial censorship decisions, that is, restricted access rather than a complete ban, to be made without any reference to a work's moral value at all. As discussed earlier, the strong causal thesis that certain artworks will corrupt their audience is implausible, given that at least some audience members may resist the corrupting influence of the artwork, and would be very difficult to prove; empirical as well as conceptual investigation would be required. It seems likely that the most we could be sure of is that a certain artwork had the potential to corrupt some audience members. The obvious next question is which audience members would be most likely to be affected. This is partly what is behind the film and television classification scheme; a kind of scaled censorship. The criterion here for the recommended restrictions on the audience is simply age. But the possibility that such works might morally corrupt some of their audience is not the only reason for classifying some such works as suitable for only an adult audience. More often the concern is simply that the issues raised by certain films or television programs are issues only a person of a certain age could properly grasp. Some films might be deemed too confusing, too frightening, or too explicit for a young audience's comfort level, for instance, regardless of the moral status of those films. In these cases, a limited censorship is decided largely by judging what is appropriate for certain age groups, and this need not have anything to do with a work's moral value.

This very brief comment on censorship is only intended to point out that although the ability to make sound moral judgments about artworks is sometimes relevant to censorship decisions, it isn't always, and, furthermore, the judgment that a work is immoral is not sufficient grounds for that work to be censored; there are other pertinent issues to be taken into account. While a thesis such as this one could provide a starting point for further discussion on those censorship decisions which are based on judgments about the moral value of literary artworks, the issue of censorship is a substantial topic, which needs to be dealt with separately from the subject of the moral value of literary art.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Anderson, J.C. & Dean, J.T., "Moderate Autonomism," British Journal of Aesthetics, (Vol. 38, Issue 2, 1998).
    • Defends 'moderate autonomism', arguing against both moderate moralism and ethicism.
  • Beardsley, M.C., Aesthetics: Problems in the Philosophy of Criticism, (New York: Harcourt, Brace & World, Inc., 1958).
    • Considers some of the main issues in philsophical aesthetics.
  • Beardsmore, R.W., Art & Morality, (London: Macmillan, 1971).
    • This book covers the more traditional positions on the ethical criticism of art.
  • Bell, C., "Significant Form," (1914) in J. Hospers (ed.), Introductory Readings in Aesthetics, (N.Y.: The Free Press, 1969).
    • An argument for a narrow version of 'formalism' with respect to the evaluation of art.
  • Booth, W., "Why Banning Ethical Criticism is a Serious Mistake," Philosophy and Literature, (Vol. 22, 1998).
    • A defence of the practice of the ethical criticism of art; particularly targetting Posner's arguments against it.
  • Carroll, N., "Moderate Moralism," British Journal of Aesthetics, (Vol. 36, No. 3, 1996).
    • Introduces and defines the positions 'moderate autonomism' and ‘moderate moralism’, defending the latter against any form of autonomism.
  • Carroll, N., "Moderate Moralism versus Moderate Autonomism," British Journal of Aesthetics, (Vol. 38, Issue 4, 1998a).
    • A further defence of 'moderate moralism' against objections from moderate autonomists, J.C. Anderson and J.T. Dean.
  • Carroll, N., "Art, Narrative and Moral Understanding," in Levinson, J. (ed.), Aesthetics and Ethics, (Cambridge: CUP, 1998b).
    • An argument for the leitimacy of the ethical criticism of narrative froms of art.
  • Carroll, N., "Art and Ethical Criticism: An Overview of Recent Directions of Research," Ethics, (Vol. 110, 2000).
    • Explains the three main forms of objection to ethical criticism - autonomism, cognitive triviality and anti-consequentialism - and attempts to answer each of these objections, defnding 'moderate moralism.
  • Conolly, O., "Ethicism and Moderate Moralism," British Journal of Aesthetics, (Vol. 40, Issue 3), 2000.
    • Considers some possible interpretations of 'moderate moralism', compares moderate moralism with 'ethicism' and defends ethicism as the more plausible of the two positions
  • Devereaux, M., "Beauty and Evil: the case of Leni Riefensthal's Triumph of the Will," in J. Levinson (ed.), Aesthetics and Ethics, (Cambridge: CUP, 1998).
    • Gives a detailed analysis of the morally problematic film Triumph of the Will, and through this analysis argues that 'formalism' and sophisticated formalism' are inadequate ways of responding to such a film.
  • Gaut, B., "The Ethical Criticism of Art," in Levinson, J. (ed.), Aesthetics and Ethics, (Cambridge: CUP, 1998).
    • Proposes a new position with respect to the ethical criticism of art, ethicism, which argues for an 'all-things-considered' evaluation of aesthetic value which takes into account any moral merits or defects exhibited by an artwork.
  • Kieran, M., "In Defence of the Ethical Evaluation of Art," British Journal of Aesthetics, (Vol. 41, Issue 1, 2001).
    • Argues for an ammendment to Carroll's 'moderate moralism’, called ‘most moderate moralism’, which focusses on the intelligibility of artworks.
  • Levinson, J. (ed.), Aesthetics & Ethics, (Cambridge: CUP, 1998).
    • A selection of essays at the interesection of ethics and aesthetics, most of the essays dealing with ethical issues in narrative art.
  • Nussbaum, M., "Exactly and Responsibly: A Defense of Ethical Criticism," Philosophy and Literature, (Vol. 22, 1998).
    • A defense of the practice of ethical criticism; in particular a defense of Nussbaum's thesis that certain works of literature potentially play an important supplementary role in moral education.
  • Nussbaum, M., "Finely Aware and Richly Responsible: Literature and the Moral Imagination," in Cascardi, A.J. (ed.), Literature and the Question of Philosophy, (Baltimore and London: The John Hopkins University Press, 1987).
    • Explains the view described above with detailed reference to the novels of Henry James.
  • Posner, R., "Against Ethical Criticism," Philosophy and Literature, (Vol. 21, 1997).
    • Argues against the practice of ethical criticism on the grounds of autonomism, cognitive triviality and anti-consequentialism.
  • Posner, R., "Against Ethical Criticism: Part Two," Philosophy and Literature, (Vol. 22:2, 1998).
    • Responds to Nussbaum and Booth's defence of ethical criticism against Posner’s original article.
  • Stow, S., "Unbecoming Virulence: The Politics of the Ethical Criticism Debate," Philosophy and Literature, (Vol. 24, 2000).
    • Suggests ways in which the debate between Posner, Nussbaum and Booth over the ethical criticism of art was heavily influenced by their respective political differences.
  • Tolstoy, L., What Is Art? (London: Bristol Classical Press, 1994).
    • For the purposes of this subject, the significant aspect of Tolstoy's book is his emphasis on the moral import of art in society as essential to the (aesthetic) value of that art. Tolstoy is a 'radical moralist' with respect to the ethical criticism of art.
  • Wilde, O., "The Preface to The Picture of Dorian Gray," in Wilde, O., Plays, Prose Writings and Poems, (London: J.M. Dent & Sons, 1975).
    • In the preface to his, ironically, very moral story, Wilde claims that the moral merits or defects of art should in no way influence its aesthetic evaluation.

Author Information

Ella Peek

Art and Epistemology

art-epThe relationship between art and epistemology has been forever tenuous and fraught with much debate. It seems fairly obvious that we gain something meaningful from experiences and interactions with works of art. It does not seem so obvious whether or not the experiences we have with art can produce propositional knowledge that is constituted by true justified belief. In what follows I will give some historical background on the debate and flesh out some of the important issues surrounding the question “(What) can we learn from art?”

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Plato and Aristotle
  3. Rationalists, Empiricists, and Romantics
  4. Knowledge Claims about the Arts
  5. Art and Moral Knowledge
  6. Additional Objections
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

While engaging objects aesthetically is both a perceptual and emotionally laden activity, it is also fundamentally cognitive. As such, aesthetic engagement is wedded to a number of epistemological concerns. For example, we commonly claim to know things about art, and we respect what critics say about various genres of art. We say that we thought the play was good or bad, that the emotions it produced were warranted, justified, manipulative, or appropriate. People commonly claim that they learn from art, that art changes their perception of the world, and that art has an impact on the way that they see and make sense of the world. It is also widely believed that works of art, especially good works of art, can engender beliefs about the world and can, in turn, provide knowledge about the world. But what is it exactly that we can know about art? What is it precisely that art can teach us? Is there any sort of propositional content that art can provide which resembles the content that we claim to need for other kinds of knowledge claims? These are the sorts of questions that frame the debate about whether, and in what sense, art is cognitive.

2. Plato and Aristotle

The question whether or not we can learn from art goes as far back as Plato, as he warned about the dangers of indulging in both mimetic and narrative representations of the world and of human actions. The ensuing debate has endured in the contemporary philosophical literature and has spurred the further question of how we can learn from art. The arguments both for and against the notion that we can learn from art have developed as well. The debate is not any less complicated than it was historically, nor is it any closer to being resolved.

There are two extreme positions that one could take in answer to the question, "Can we learn from art?" Either we can, and do, learn from art, or we cannot in any meaningful sense attain knowledge that is non-propositional. Those who argue that we can learn from art generally argue that our engagement with art arouses certain emotions or activities that are able to facilitate or produce knowledge. They would argue that there is some aspect of the artwork which can help to produce greater understanding of the world around us. Art is thus seen as a source of insight and awareness that cannot be put into propositional language; but it can help us to see the world in a new or different way.

Those who deny that we can learn from art often argue that there can be no knowledge that is not propositionally-based knowledge. Jerome Stolnitz, for example, claims in a 1992 article that art does not and cannot contribute to knowledge primarily because it does not generate any sort of truths. Those who argue this line want to defend the notion that since art cannot provide facts or generate arguments, then we cannot learn from it. Further, those who believe we cannot learn from art argue that art cannot be understood as a source of knowledge because it is not productive of knowledge, taken in the traditional sense of justified true belief. Art does not have propositional content that can be learned in a traditional way, even though it can been seen to have effects that promote knowledge and that can either encourage or undermine the development of understanding. Art can thus be rejected as a source of knowledge because it does not provide true beliefs, and because it does not and cannot justify the beliefs that it does convey. Both extremes agree that if art can be seen as a source of knowledge, the only way that it could possibly fulfill such a function would be if that knowledge reflected something essential to art's nature and value.

Plato points out in the Republic (595-601) that it is possible to make a representation of something without having knowledge of the thing represented. Painters represent cobblers when the painters have no knowledge of shoemaking themselves, and poets write about beauty and courage without necessarily having any clear knowledge of these virtues. Only philosophers, the lovers of wisdom, and especially those who strive to intuit the Forms and employ abstract reasoning, can really have knowledge of these virtues. Artists mislead their viewers into thinking that knowledge lies in the represented (mimetic) object. Plato's concern in the Republic extends to the literary arts in particular, which are created with the express purpose to move us emotionally in such a way that one's character could be corrupted (605-608). The more one indulges in emotions aroused by representation, according to Plato, the more likely one is to suffer the effects of an unbalanced soul, and ultimately the development of a bad character.

Aristotle agreed with Plato that art could indeed influence the development of one's moral character. While Plato thought that we can learn from art and that it is detrimental to one's character, however, Aristotle argued that indulging in the same mimetic emotions that Plato warned us of can actually benefit one's character by producing an emotional catharsis (Poetics 1449b24-29). By purging the tragic emotions in particular, Aristotle held, one has a better chance of being more rational in everyday life. Thus, while both philosophers believed that we learn from art, one (Plato) argued that the knowledge gained was detrimental while the other (Aristotle) argued that it was beneficial.

3. Rationalists, Empiricists, and Romantics

Continuing with the line of argument Aristotle began, all the way through the Renaissance and beyond, philosophers have defended the notion that we can learn from art, and that poetry and fiction engage the emotions in a helpful, rather than detrimental, way. The Romantics dealt with this question in a manner that the earlier rationalists and empiricists did not. The rationalists rejected the idea that the imagination could be considered a source of knowledge, with Descartes going so far as to dismiss what he called "the blundering constructions of the imagination." Returning to the ideals of Plato, the rationalists strictly employed a knowledge requirement involving justified true belief. Empiricist epistemology too is particularly unhelpful when it comes to explaining how we might gain justified knowledge from fictional or representational situations. For it seems impossible to learn actual things from fictional situations.

The Romantics provided the real beginnings of an argument against the passive accounts of knowledge for which the empiricists argued. Romantic epistemology emphasizes the role of the imagination in addition to (or over) reason. This allowed for the notion that there is not merely one right way to know, and that there is not only one right way to view, experience, understand, and construct the world.

The Romantics adopted three main tenets concerning the relationship between literature (and art more generally) and truth. The first denied that there is any one point of view from which Truth can be determined. The second began to question the Augustinian conviction that art and literature, like science, should concern only general features of nature. The third tenet, which the Romantics developed more fully, concerned the notion of transcendence, especially in association with growth. Natural science is able to describe the physical world, but only from a single point of view (Harrison 1998). Art and literature can describe the world in a myriad of ways, transcending experience of the physical world into the emotional and even the supernatural. Although art does not record truths about the world in the same way that science does, it can give insight into the different ways that we understand the world and with different degrees of accuracy. It is those degrees of accuracy that continue to be called into question.

4. Knowledge Claims about the Arts

David Novitz (1998) points out that there are three basic kinds of knowledge claims we can make about the arts, all of which are distinguished by their objects. The first concerns what we claim to know or believe about the art object itself and whatever imaginary or fictional worlds might be connected to that object. For example, I can claim to know things about the way the light reflects in Monet's Water Lilies. I can also claim to know things about Anna Karenina's relationships with her husband and with her lover, Vronsky. Beyond this, we may feel justified in our pity for Anna, because of the way Tolstoy's novel presents her story. Can my knowledge of Anna be meaningful, however, or be considered knowledge at all in the traditional sense (justified true belief) if Anna Karenina is a non-referring name? Further, how can one's interpretation of her situation be any more legitimate than anyone else's? Can single interpretations hold value over time and across cultures? Without the propositional content used to legitimize the standard analysis of knowledge, it seems that the knowledge claims we have about the content of an artwork will never have the same kind of validity. Whether or not that same kind of validity is required also needs to be called into question.

The second kind of knowledge claim we can make about art concerns what we know or believe to be an appropriate or warranted emotional response to the artwork. We often believe that works of art are only properly understood if we have a certain kind of emotional response to them. One problem here, of course, concerns how it is that we know what kind of response is appropriate to a particular work. On occasion we talk to friends about a response they had to a particular work of art that was manifestly different from the one we had. How is it possible to judge which response is more appropriate or justified? Even suggesting that one should respond as if a novel, for example, were to be taken as an account of true events, with responses following as if the events depicted therein were actually happening or had happened, does not solve the problem. For one thing, not all emotional responses to real events are taken as equally justified. For another, most novels are not meant to be taken as true (despite the "report model" of emotive response [see Matravers 1997]). The fact that we do respond emotively to art, and to fiction in particular, would seem to indicate that there is something in the artwork that is worth responding to, even if it is not the same thing possessed by the objects we respond to outside the art world.

The third kind of knowledge claim we can have about art concerns the sort of information art can provide about the world. That is, how is it that we can gain real knowledge from fictional or non-real events or activities? It is widely accepted that art does, in fact, convey important insight into the way we order and understand the world. It is also widely acknowledged that art gives a certain degree of meaning to our lives. Art, and literature in particular, can elicit new beliefs and even new knowledge about the world. But the concern is this: fiction is not produced in a way that is reflective of the world as it actually is. It might be quite dangerous, in fact, for one to obtain knowledge about human affairs only from fiction. For example, it could be downright unhealthy for me to get my sense of what it is like to be in love from romance novels alone.

We can easily be experientially misled by art. The so-called empathic beliefs, those we gain from experiencing art, should be based on and enhanced by our broader experience of the world and should not arise independently of our other beliefs. But here the problem of justification returns. That is, if the empathic beliefs we gain from our experience of art actually coincide with our experience of the real world, then they can pass as empathic knowledge (that is, beliefs become true and justified when they are connected to other justified beliefs). The problem is that often the emotions and beliefs that we adopt empathically turn out to be temporary, since they are not grounded in concrete experience. Can the experience we have with a work of art be confirming in and of itself, or must there be another, external authority to make the experience, or at least the knowledge gained from the experience, legitimate? It seems that much of what we learn about the world does come from art, and thus the justificatory claims to knowledge must be reconsidered.

The propositional theory of knowledge holds that one must have justified true belief in the content of a proposition in order to have knowledge. This appears reasonable under normal circumstances, but seems not to work at all in the case of art. It seems odd, in fact, to hold that in order to show that one has learned from a work of fiction, one must show that the work has propositional content of a general or philosophical nature, or that it provides experience that cannot be gained in any other way. If we can learn from art, we must be able to do so in a manner that diverges from the traditional notion of justified true belief, but that still holds some sort of legitimate ground.

What kind of justification is needed to ground these potential knowledge claims that art provides? First of all, we must be at least somewhat aware of what the new knowledge consists of. Moreover, one's engagement with the artwork should provide at least some degree of justification (e.g., I feel pity for Anna Karenina because she is in an unfortunate set of circumstances that she feels she has no control over. I am justified in my emotional response to her if I can see that she is in a truly pitiable situation). It is important to distinguish learning from art from merely being affected or influenced by it, or even from being challenged by it. Accounts of knowledge provided by art should be able to identify clearly what it is about the artwork itself, qua artwork, which prompts knowledge. A cognitivist account in particular will require first that the content of the work be specifiable (what is it we learn?); second, that the demands for justification be respected; and third, that these accounts appeal directly to aesthetic experience (Freeland 1997).

5. Art and Moral Knowledge

It would seem that there is indeed something about the content of an artwork that can be said to be knowledge-producing. But how can that be so? The artist himself or herself is not the ultimate authority here, since his/her knowledge or expertise is not necessarily directly transferred into the artwork. Furthermore, even if it were capable of being transferred clearly, it is not always the case that observers will interpret the meaning or significance of a work of art in any standard way. What the artist knows and how others experience his/her art are not directly related enough to justify epistemic legitimacy. It also seems unjustified to assume that there are intrinsic features of an artwork that are always clearly identifiable. So the knowledge we gain from art has more to do with the relationship between the art object and the consumer than anything else.

Another way we might argue for the possibility of gaining knowledge from art is by rejecting the justified true belief account of knowledge. There might be more than one way to know, in other words, and more than one way to learn. One of the most common alternative suggestions concerning the knowledge that art elicits is that it is moral knowledge that we gain. These arguments are based primarily of the presumption that art, and literature especially, can provide experiential and emotional stimulation, and that moral knowledge is not simply propositional in nature. It has been objected, however, that such stimulation is not equal to the propositional content that more traditional forms of knowledge can provide.

Eileen John (2001) identifies two arguments for the claim that moral knowledge can be gained from art. The first argument stresses the capacity of art to give us examples of, and exercise in, certain morally pertinent activities. Thus, we come across circumstances and situations in art and literature that we might not otherwise come across in our daily lives. If we simulate our own reactions to the situations the work presents us with, we have an idea of how we might respond or how we would feel (see especially Kendall Walton's theory of Make-Believe and Simulation Theory). On this view, works of art can provide us with simulated or "off-line" emotional responses that could not be achieved otherwise.

The second argument is based on the assumption that we can acquire specific substantive moral knowledge from art. That is, works of art are taken to possess the ability to give us imaginative and epistemic access to certain kinds of experiences relevant to moral knowledge and judgment. Not only can we respond emotionally to particular moral situations presented through artworks; we cannot help but find ourselves morally outraged or saddened by the plights of certain fictional characters.

6. Additional Objections

Noël Carroll (2002) lays out three additional objections to the suggestion that art can provide knowledge. The first objection he calls the "banality argument": the idea that “the significant truths that many claim art and literature may afford—that is, general truths about life, usually of an implied nature (as opposed to what is 'true in the fiction')—are in the main, trivial." Compared to the knowledge we are able to obtain from propositional statements and arguments, the kind of things works of literature are can point out are so obvious as to be useless. Carroll continues by stating that "art and knowledge are not sources of moral knowledge, but, at best, occasions for activating antecedently possessed knowledge." The best it seems that art and literature can do is to point out things we already know and believe.

The second objection Carroll outlines against the notion that we can learn from art is what he calls the "no-evidence argument." This focuses on the fact that not only is anything we gain from art and literature banal, but for any knowledge to be legitimate, it needs to be warranted and must be supported by evidence. Few artworks, however, supply any evidence at all in defense of a particular view. One of the reasons interpretations seem to legitimately vary so widely is precisely due to this lack of solid evidence. Moreover, fiction is not a reliable source of evidence when it comes to literature and other arts.

Carroll calls the third objection the "no-argument argument." As he explains, “it maintains that even if artworks contained or implied general truths, neither the artworks themselves nor the critical discourse that surrounds them engages in argument, analysis, and debate in defense of the alleged truths." If artworks do indeed suggest any sort of knowledge, Carroll points out, it can only be suggested or implied but never argued for or defended. Furthermore, the critical discourse that surrounds artworks is not generally focused on arguing for or against any of the claims made in the artwork itself.

7. Conclusion

The fact that we do respond to works of art, and that we commonly believe we can and do learn from such works, is not enough to justify that learning actually occurs. However, it is enough to make us examine our presuppositions about what constitutes knowledge, and perhaps may lead us to reconceive knowledge in such a way that we may eventually come to understand how it can be gained non-propositionally.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Bender, John. "Art as a Source of Knowledge: Linking Analytic Aesthetics and Epistemology." In Contemporary Philosophy of Art, ed. John Bender and Gene Blocker. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice Hall, 1993.
  • Carroll, Noël. "Art, Narrative, and Moral Understanding." In Aesthetics and Ethics: Essays at the Intersection, ed. Jerrold Levinson. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Carroll, Noël. "Moderate Moralism." British Journal of Aesthetics 36 (1996): 223-38.
  • Carroll, Noël. "The Wheel of Virtue: Art, Literature, and Moral Knowledge." Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 60.1 (Winter 2002): 3-26.
  • Diffey, T.J. "What Can We Learn From Art?" Australasian Journal of Philosophy 73 (1995): 202-11.
  • Freeland, Cynthia. "Art and Moral Knowledge." Philosophical Topics 25.1 (Spring 1997): 11-36.
  • Graham, Gordon. "Value and the Visual Arts." Journal of Aesthetic Education 28 (1994): 1-14.
  • Graham, Gordon. "Learning From Art." British Journal of Aesthetics 35 (1995): 26-37.
  • Harrison, Bernard. "Literature and Cognition." In Encyclopedia of Aesthetics, ed. Michael Kelly. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998.
  • John, Eileen. "Reading Fiction and Conceptual Knowledge: Philosophical Thought in Literary Context." Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 56 (1998): 331-48.
  • John, Eileen. "Art and Knowledge." The Routledge Companion to Aesthetics, eds. Berys Gaut and Dominic McIver Lopes. London: Routledge, 2001.
  • Feagin, Susan. "Paintings and Their Places." Australasian Journal of Philosophy 73.2 (1995): 260-68.
  • Kieran, Matthew. "Art, Imagination, and the Cultivation of Morals." Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 54 (1996): 337-51.
  • Lamarque, Peter and Stein Olsen. Truth, Fiction, and Literature. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1994.
  • Matravers, Derek. "The Report Model versus the Perceptual Model." In Emotion and the Arts, eds. Mette Hjort and Sue Laver. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1997, 78-92.
  • Novitz, David. "Aesthetics and Epistemology." In Encyclopedia of Aesthetics, ed. Michael Kelly. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998.
  • Nussbaum, Martha. Love's Knowledge: Essays on Philosophy and Literature. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1990.
  • Nussbaum, Martha. Poetic Justice: The Literary Imagination and Public Life. Boston: Beacon Press, 1995.
  • Reid, Louis Arnaud. "Art and Knowledge." British Journal of Aesthetics 25 (1985): 115-24.
  • Robinson, Jennifer. "L'Education Sentimentale." Australasian Journal of Philosophy 73 (1995): 212-26.
  • Stolnitz, Jerome. "On the Cognitive Triviality of Art." British Journal of Aesthetics 32 (July 1992): 191-200.
  • Walton, Kendall. Mimesis as Make Believe: On the Foundations of the Representational Arts. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1990.
  • Wilson, Catherine. "Literature and Knowledge." Philosophy 58 (1983): 489-96.
  • Young, James O. Art and Knowledge. London: Routledge, 2001.

Author Information

Sarah E. Worth
Furman University
U. S. A.


aesthetiAesthetics may be defined narrowly as the theory of beauty, or more broadly as that together with the philosophy of art. The traditional interest in beauty itself broadened, in the eighteenth century, to include the sublime, and since 1950 or so the number of pure aesthetic concepts discussed in the literature has expanded even more. Traditionally, the philosophy of art concentrated on its definition, but recently this has not been the focus, with careful analyses of aspects of art largely replacing it. Philosophical aesthetics is here considered to center on these latter-day developments. Thus, after a survey of ideas about beauty and related concepts, questions about the value of aesthetic experience and the variety of aesthetic attitudes will be addressed, before turning to matters which separate art from pure aesthetics, notably the presence of intention. That will lead to a survey of some of the main definitions of art which have been proposed, together with an account of the recent “de-definition” period. The concepts of expression, representation, and the nature of art objects will then be covered.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Aesthetic Concepts
  3. Aesthetic Value
  4. Aesthetic Attitudes
  5. Intentions
  6. Definitions of Art
  7. Expression
  8. Representation
  9. Art Objects
  10. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The full field of what might be called “aesthetics” is a very large one. There is even now a four-volume encyclopedia devoted to the full range of possible topics. The core issues in Philosophical Aesthetics, however, are nowadays fairly settled (see the book edited by Dickie, Sclafani, and Roblin, and the monograph by Sheppard, among many others).

Aesthetics in this central sense has been said to start in the early eighteenth century, with the series of articles on “The Pleasures of the Imagination” which the journalist Joseph Addison wrote in the early issues of the magazine The Spectator in 1712. Before this time, thoughts by notable figures made some forays into this ground, for instance in the formulation of general theories of proportion and harmony, detailed most specifically in architecture and music. But the full development of extended, philosophical reflection on Aesthetics did not begin to emerge until the widening of leisure activities in the eighteenth century.

By far the most thoroughgoing and influential of the early theorists was Immanuel Kant, towards the end of the eighteenth century. Therefore it is important, first of all, to have some sense of how Kant approached the subject. Criticisms of his ideas, and alternatives to them, will be presented later in this entry, but through him we can meet some of the key concepts in the subject by way of introduction.

Kant is sometimes thought of as a formalist in art theory; that is to say, someone who thinks the content of a work of art is not of aesthetic interest. But this is only part of the story. Certainly he was a formalist about the pure enjoyment of nature, but for Kant most of the arts were impure, because they involved a “concept.” Even the enjoyment of parts of nature was impure, namely when a concept was involved— as when we admire the perfection of an animal body or a human torso. But our enjoyment of, for instance, the arbitrary abstract patterns in some foliage, or a color field (as with wild poppies, or a sunset) was, according to Kant, absent of such concepts; in such cases, the cognitive powers were in free play. By design, art may sometimes obtain the appearance of this freedom: it was then “Fine Art”—but for Kant not all art had this quality.

In all, Kant’s theory of pure beauty had four aspects: its freedom from concepts, its objectivity, the disinterest of the spectator, and its obligatoriness. By “concept,” Kant meant “end,” or “purpose,” that is, what the cognitive powers of human understanding and imagination judge applies to an object, such as with “it is a pebble,” to take an instance. But when no definite concept is involved, as with the scattered pebbles on a beach, the cognitive powers are held to be in free play; and it is when this play is harmonious that there is the experience of pure beauty. There is also objectivity and universality in the judgment then, according to Kant, since the cognitive powers are common to all who can judge that the individual objects are pebbles. These powers function alike whether they come to such a definite judgment or are left suspended in free play, as when appreciating the pattern along the shoreline. This was not the basis on which the apprehension of pure beauty was obligatory, however. According to Kant, that derived from the selflessness of such an apprehension, what was called in the eighteenth century its “disinterest.” This arises because pure beauty does not gratify us sensuously; nor does it induce any desire to possess the object. It “pleases,” certainly, but in a distinctive intellectual way. Pure beauty, in other words, simply holds our mind’s attention: we have no further concern than contemplating the object itself. Perceiving the object in such cases is an end in itself; it is not a means to a further end, and is enjoyed for its own sake alone.

It is because Morality requires we rise above ourselves that such an exercise in selfless attention becomes obligatory. Judgments of pure beauty, being selfless, initiate one into the moral point of view. “Beauty is a symbol of Morality,” and “The enjoyment of nature is the mark of a good soul” are key sayings of Kant. The shared enjoyment of a sunset or a beach shows there is harmony between us all, and the world.

Among these ideas, the notion of “disinterest” has had much the widest currency. Indeed, Kant took it from eighteenth century theorists before him, such as the moral philosopher, Lord Shaftesbury, and it has attracted much attention since: recently by the French sociologist Pierre Bourdieu, for instance. Clearly, in this context “disinterested” does not mean “uninterested,” and paradoxically it is closest to what we now call our “interests,” that is, such things as hobbies, travel, and sport, as we shall see below. But in earlier centuries, one’s “interest” was what was to one’s advantage, that is, it was “self-interest,” and so it was the negation of that which closely related aesthetics to ethics.

2. Aesthetic Concepts

The eighteenth century was a surprisingly peaceful time, but this turned out to be the lull before the storm, since out of its orderly classicism there developed a wild romanticism in art and literature, and even revolution in politics. The aesthetic concept which came to be more appreciated in this period was associated with this, namely sublimity, which Edmund Burke theorized about in his “A Philosophical Enquiry into the Origin of our ideas of the Sublime and Beautiful.” The sublime was connected more with pain than pure pleasure, according to Burke, since threats to self-preservation were involved, as on the high seas, and lonely moors, with the devilish humans and dramatic passions that artists and writers were about to portray. But in these circumstances, of course, it is still “delightful horror,” as Burke appreciated, since one is insulated by the fictionality of the work in question from any real danger.

“Sublime” and “beautiful” are only two amongst the many terms which may be used to describe our aesthetic experiences. Clearly there are “ridiculous” and “ugly,” for a start, as well. But the more discriminating will have no difficulty also finding something maybe “fine,” or “lovely” rather than “awful” or “hideous,” and “exquisite” or “superb” rather than “gross” or “foul.” Frank Sibley wrote a notable series of articles, starting in 1959, defending a view of aesthetic concepts as a whole. He said that they were not rule- or condition-governed, but required a heightened form of perception, which one might call taste, sensitivity, or judgment. His full analysis, however, contained another aspect, since he was not only concerned with the sorts of concepts mentioned above, but also with a set of others which had a rather different character. For one can describe works of art, often enough, in terms which relate primarily to the emotional and mental life of human beings. One can call them “joyful,” “melancholy,” “serene,” “witty,” “vulgar,” and “humble,” for instance. These are evidently not purely aesthetic terms, because of their further uses, but they are still very relevant to many aesthetic experiences.

Sibley’s claim about these concepts was that there were no sufficient conditions for their application. For many concepts—sometimes called “closed” concepts, as a result—both necessary and sufficient conditions for their application can be given. To be a bachelor, for instance, it is necessary to be male and unmarried, though of marriageable age, and together these three conditions are sufficient. For other concepts, however, the so-called “open” ones, no such definitions can be given— although for aesthetic concepts Sibley pointed out there were still some necessary conditions, since certain facts can rule out the application of, for example, “garish,” “gaudy,” or “flamboyant.”

The question therefore arises: how do we make aesthetic judgments if not by checking sufficient conditions? Sibley’s account was that, when the concepts were not purely perceptual they were mostly metaphoric. Thus, we call artworks “dynamic,” or “sad,” as before, by comparison with the behaviors of humans with those qualities. Other theorists, such as Rudolph Arnheim and Roger Scruton, have held similar views. Scruton, in fact, discriminated eight types of aesthetic concept, and we shall look at some of the others below.

3. Aesthetic Value

We have noted Kant’s views about the objectivity and universality of judgments of pure beauty, and there are several ways that these notions have been further defended. There is a famous curve, for instance, obtained by the nineteenth century psychologist Wilhelm Wundt, which shows how human arousal is quite generally related to complexity of stimulus. We are bored by the simple, become sated, even over-anxious, by the increasingly complex, while in between there is a region of greatest pleasure. The dimension of complexity is only one objective measure of worth which has been proposed in this way. Thus it is now known, for instance, that judgments of facial beauty in humans are a matter of averageness and symmetry. Traditionally, unity was taken to be central, notably by Aristotle in connection with Drama, and when added to complexity it formed a general account of aesthetic value. Thus Francis Hutcheson, in the eighteenth century, asserted that “Uniformity in variety always makes an object beautiful.” Monroe Beardsley, more recently, has introduced a third criterion—intensity—to produce his three “General Canons” of objective worth. He also detailed some “Special Canons.”

Beardsley called the objective criteria within styles of Art “Special Canons.” These were not a matter of something being good of its kind and so involving perfection of a concept in the sense of Kant. They involved defeasible “good-making” and “bad-making” features, more in the manner Hume explained in his major essay in this area, “Of the Standard of Taste” (1757). To say a work of art had a positive quality like humor, for instance, was to praise it to some degree, but this could be offset by other qualities which made the work not good as a whole. Beardsley defended all of his canons in a much more detailed way than his eighteenth century predecessor however: through a lengthy, fine-grained, historical analysis of what critics have actually appealed to in the evaluation of artworks. Also, he explicitly made the disclaimer that his canons were the only criteria of value, by separating these “objective reasons” from what he called “affective” and “genetic” reasons. These two other sorts of reasons were to do with audience response, and the originating artist and his times, respectively, and either “The Affective Fallacy” or “The Intentional Fallacy,” he maintained, was involved if these were considered. The discrimination enabled Beardsley to focus on the artwork and its representational relations, if any, to objects in the public world.

Against Beardsley, over many years, Joseph Margolis maintained a “Robust Relativism.” Thus he wanted to say that “aptness,” “partiality,” and “non-cognitivism” characterize art appreciation, rather than “truth,” “universality,” and “knowledge.” He defended this with respect to aesthetic concepts, critical judgments of value, and literary interpretations in particular, saying, more generally, that works of art were “culturally emergent entities” not directly accessible, because of this, to any faculty resembling sense perception. The main debate over aesthetic value, indeed, concerns social and political matters, and the seemingly inevitable partiality of different points of view. The central question concerns whether there is a privileged class, namely those with aesthetic interests, or whether their set of interests has no distinguished place, since, from a sociological perspective, that taste is just one amongst all other tastes in the democratic economy. The sociologist Arnold Hauser preferred a non-relativistic point of view, and was prepared to give a ranking of tastes. High art beat popular art, Hauser said, because of two things: the significance of its content, and the more creative nature of its forms. Roger Taylor, by contrast, set out very fully the “leveller’s” point of view, declaring that "Aida" and "The Sound of Music" have equal value for their respective audiences. He defended this with a thorough philosophical analysis, rejecting the idea that there is such a thing as truth corresponding to an external reality, with the people capable of accessing that truth having some special value. Instead, according to Taylor, there are just different conceptual schemes, in which truth is measured merely by coherence internal to the scheme itself. Janet Wolff looked at this debate more disinterestedly, in particular studying the details of the opposition between Kant and Bourdieu.

4. Aesthetic Attitudes

Jerome Stolnitz, in the middle of the last century, was a Kantian, and promoted the need for a disinterested, objective attitude to art objects. It is debatable, as we saw before, whether this represents Kant’s total view of art, but the disinterested treatment of art objects which Stolnitz recommended was very commonly pursued in his period.

Edward Bullough, writing in 1912, would have called “disinterested attention” a “distanced” attitude, but he used this latter term to generate a much fuller and more detailed appreciation of the whole spectrum of attitudes which might be taken to artworks. The spectrum stretched from people who “over-distance” to people who “under-distance.” People who over-distance are, for instance, critics who merely look at the technicalities and craftwork of a production, missing any emotional involvement with what it is about. Bullough contrasted this attitude with what he called “under-distancing,” where one might get too gripped by the content. The country yokel who jumps upon the stage to save the heroine, and the jealous husband who sees himself as Othello smothering his wife, are missing the fact that the play is an illusion, a fiction, just make-believe. Bullough thought there was, instead, an ideal mid-point between his two extremes, thereby solving his “antinomy of distance” by deciding there should be the least possible distance without its disappearance.

George Dickie later argued against both “disinterest” and “distance” in a famous 1964 paper, “The Myth of the Aesthetic Attitude.” He argued that we should be able to enjoy all objects of awareness, whether “pure aesthetic” or moral. In fact, he thought the term “aesthetic” could be used in all cases, rejecting the idea that there was some authorized way of using the word just to apply to surface or formal features— the artwork as a thing in itself. As a result, Dickie concluded that the aesthetic attitude, when properly understood, reduced to just close attention to whatever holds one’s mind in an artwork, against the tradition which believed it had a certain psychological quality, or else involved attention just to certain objects.

Art is not the only object to draw interest of this pleasurable kind: hobbies and travel are further examples, and sport yet another, as was mentioned briefly above. In particular, the broadening of the aesthetic tradition in recent years has led theorists to give more attention to sport. David Best, for instance, writing on sport and its likeness to art, highlighted how close sport is to the purely aesthetic. But he wanted to limit sport to this, and insisted it had no relevance to ethics. Best saw art forms as distinguished expressly by their having the capacity to comment on life situations, and hence bring in moral considerations. No sport had this further capacity, he thought, although the enjoyment of many sports may undoubtedly be aesthetic. But many art forms—perhaps more clearly called “craft-forms” as a result— also do not comment on life situations overmuch, for example, décor, abstract painting, and non-narrative ballet. And there are many sports which are pre-eminently seen in moral, “character-building” terms, for example, mountaineering, and the various combat sports (like boxing and wrestling). Perhaps the resolution comes through noting the division Best himself provides within sport-forms, between, on the one hand, “task” or “non-purposive” sports like gymnastics, diving, and synchronized swimming, which are the ones he claims are aesthetic, and on the other hand the “achievement,” or “purposive’ sports, like those combat sports above. Task sports have less “art” in them, since they are not as creative as the purposive ones.

5. Intentions

The traditional form of art criticism was biographical and sociological, taking into account the conceptions of the artist and the history of the traditions within which the artist worked. But in the twentieth century a different, more scientific and ahistorical form of literary criticism grew up in the United States and Britain: The New Criticism. Like the Russian Formalists and French Structuralists in the same period, the New Critics regarded what could be gleaned from the work of art alone as relevant to its assessment, but their specific position received a much-discussed philosophical defense by William Wimsatt and Monroe Beardsley in 1946. Beardsley saw the position as an extension of “The Aesthetic Point of View”; Wimsatt was a practical critic personally engaged in the new line of approach. In their essay “The Intentional Fallacy,” Wimsatt and Beardsley claimed “the design or intention of the artist is neither available nor desirable as a standard for judging the success of a work of literary art.” It was not always available, since it was often difficult to obtain, but, in any case, it was not appropriately available, according to them, unless there was evidence for it internal to the finished work of art. Wimsatt and Beardsley allowed such forms of evidence for a writer’s intentions, but would allow nothing external to the given text.

This debate over intention in the literary arts has raged with full force into more recent times. A contemporary of Wimsatt and Beardsley, E.D. Hirsch, has continued to maintain his “intentionalist” point of view. Against him, Steven Knapp and Walter Benn Michaels have taken up an ahistorical position. Frank Cioffi, one of the original writers who wrote a forceful reply to Wimsatt and Beardsley, aligned himself with neither camp, believing different cases were “best read” sometimes just as, sometimes other than as, the artist knowingly intended them. One reason he rejected intention, at times, was because he believed the artist might be unconscious of the full significance of the artwork.

A similar debate arises in other art forms besides Literature, for instance Architecture, Theater, and Music, although it has caused less professional comment in these arts, occurring more at the practical level in terms of argument between “purists” and “modernizers.” Purists want to maintain a historical orientation to these art forms, while modernizers want to make things more available for contemporary use. The debate also has a more practical aspect in connection with the visual arts. For it arises in the question of what devalues fakes and forgeries, and by contrast puts a special value on originality. There have been several notable frauds perpetrated by forgers of artworks and their associates. The question is: if the surface appearance is much the same, what especial value is there in the first object? Nelson Goodman was inclined to think that one can always locate a sufficient difference by looking closely at the visual appearance. But even if one cannot, there remain the different histories of the original and the copy, and also the different intentions behind them.

The relevance of such intentions in visual art has entered very prominently into philosophical discussion. Arthur Danto, in his 1964 discussion of “The Artworld,” was concerned with the question of how the atmosphere of theory can alter how we see artworks. This situation has arisen in fact with respect to two notable paintings which look the same, as Timothy Binkley has explained, namely Leonardo’s original “Mona Lisa” and Duchamp’s joke about it, called “L.H.O.O.Q. Shaved.” The two works look ostensibly the same, but Duchamp, one needs to know, had also produced a third work, “L.H.O.O.Q.,” which was a reproduction of the "Mona Lisa," with some graffiti on it: a goatee and moustache. He was alluding in that work to the possibility that the sitter for the "Mona Lisa" might have been a young male, given the stories about Leonardo’s homosexuality. With the graffiti removed the otherwise visually similar works are still different, since Duchamp’s title, and the history of its production, alters what we think about his piece.

6. Definitions of Art

Up to the “de-definition” period, definitions of art fell broadly into three types, relating to representation, expression, and form. The dominance of representation as a central concept in art lasted from before Plato’s time to around the end of the eighteenth century. Of course, representational art is still to be found to this day, but it is no longer pre-eminent in the way it once was. Plato first formulated the idea by saying that art is mimesis, and, for instance, Bateaux in the eighteenth century followed him, when saying: “Poetry exists only by imitation. It is the same thing with painting, dance and music; nothing is real in their works, everything is imagined, painted, copied, artificial. It is what makes their essential character as opposed to nature.”

In the same century and the following one, with the advent of Romanticism, the concept of expression became more prominent. Even around Plato’s time, his pupil Aristotle preferred an expression theory: art as catharsis of the emotions. And Burke, Hutcheson, and Hume also promoted the idea that what was crucial in art were audience responses: pleasure in Art was a matter of taste and sentiment. But the full flowering of the theory of Expression, in the twentieth century, has shown that this is only one side of the picture.

In the taxonomy of art terms Scruton provided, Response theories concentrate on affective qualities such as “moving,” “exciting,” “nauseous,” “tedious,” and so forth. But theories of art may be called “expression theories” even though they focus on the embodied, emotional, and mental qualities discussed before, like “joyful,” “melancholy,” “humble,” “vulgar,” and “intelligent.” As we shall see below, when recent studies of expression are covered in more detail, it has been writers like John Hospers and O.K. Bouwsma who have preferred such theories. But there are other types of theory which might, even more appropriately, be called “expression theories.” What an artist is personally expressing is the focus of self-expression theories of art, but more universal themes are often expressed by individuals, and art-historical theories see the artist as merely the channel for broader social concerns.

R. G. Collingwood in the 1930s took art to be a matter of self-expression: “By creating for ourselves an imaginary experience or activity, we express our emotions; and this is what we call art.” And the noteworthy feature of Marx’s theory of art, in the nineteenth century, and those of the many different Marxists who followed him into the twentieth century, was that they were expression theories in the “art-Historical” sense. The arts were taken, by people of this persuasion, to be part of the superstructure of society, whose forms were determined by the economic base, and so art came to be seen as expressing, or “reflecting” those material conditions. Social theories of art, however, need not be based on materialism. One of the major social theorists of the late nineteenth century was the novelist Leo Tolstoy, who had a more spiritual point of view. He said: “Art is a human activity consisting in this, that one man consciously, by means of certain external signs, hands on to others feelings he has lived through, and that others are infected by these feelings and also experience them.”

Coming into the twentieth century, the main focus shifted towards abstraction and the appreciation of form. The aesthetic, and the arts and crafts movements, in the latter part of the nineteenth century drew people towards the appropriate qualities. The central concepts in aesthetics are here the pure aesthetic ones mentioned before, like “graceful,” “elegant,” “exquisite,” “glorious,” and “nice.” But formalist qualities, such as organization, unity, and harmony, as well as variety and complexity, are closely related, as are technical judgments like “well-made,” “skilful,” and “professionally written.” The latter might be separated out as the focus of Craft theories of art, as in the idea of art as “Techne” in ancient Greece, but Formalist theories commonly focus on all of these qualities, and “aesthetes” generally find them all of central concern. Eduard Hanslick was a major late nineteenth century musical formalist; the Russian Formalists in the early years of the revolution, and the French Structuralists later, promoted the same interest in Literature. Clive Bell and Roger Fry, members of the influential Bloomsbury Group in the first decades of the twentieth century, were the most noted early promoters of this aspect of Visual art.

Bell’s famous “Aesthetic Hypothesis” was: “What quality is shared by all objects that provoke our aesthetic emotions? Only one answer seems possible— significant form. In each, lines and colors combined in a particular way; certain forms and relations of forms, stir our aesthetic emotions. These relations and combinations of lines and colors, these aesthetically moving forms, I call ‘Significant Form’; and ‘Significant Form’ is the one quality common to all works of visual art.” Clement Greenberg, in the years of the Abstract Expressionists, from the 1940s to the 1970s, also defended a version of this Formalism.

Abstraction was a major drive in early twentieth century art, but the later decades largely abandoned the idea of any tight definition of art. The “de-definition” of art was formulated in academic philosophy by Morris Weitz, who derived his views from some work of Wittgenstein on the notion of games. Wittgenstein claimed that there is nothing which all games have in common, and so the historical development of them has come about through an analogical process of generation, from paradigmatic examples merely by way of “family resemblances.”

There are, however, ways of providing a kind of definition of art which respects its open texture. The Institutional definition of art, formulated by George Dickie, is in this class: “a work of art is an artefact which has had conferred upon it the status of candidate for appreciation by the artworld.” This leaves the content of art open, since it is left up to museum directors, festival organizers, and so forth, to decide what is presented. Also, as we saw before, Dickie left the notion of “appreciation” open, since he allowed that all aspects of a work of art could be attended to aesthetically. But the notion of “artefact,” too, in this definition is not as restricted as it might seem, since anything brought into an art space as a candidate for appreciation becomes thereby “artefactualized,” according to Dickie— and so he allowed as art what are otherwise called (natural) "Found Objects," and (previously manufactured) "Readymades." Less emphasis on power brokers was found in Monroe Beardsley’s slightly earlier aesthetic definition of art: “an artwork is something produced with the intention of giving it the capacity to satisfy the aesthetic interest”— where “production” and “aesthetic” have their normal, restricted content. But this suggests that these two contemporary definitions, like the others, merely reflect the historical way that art developed in the associated period. Certainly traditional objective aesthetic standards, in the earlier twentieth century, have largely given way to free choices in all manner of things by the mandarins of the public art world more recently.

7. Expression

Response theories of art were particularly popular during the Logical Positivist period in philosophy, that is, around the 1920s and 1930s. Science was then contrasted sharply with Poetry, for instance, the former being supposedly concerned with our rational mind, the latter with our irrational emotions. Thus the noted English critic I. A. Richards tested responses to poems scientifically in an attempt to judge their value, and unsurprisingly found no uniformity. Out of this kind of study comes the common idea that “art is all subjective”: if one concentrates on whether people do or do not like a particular work of art then, naturally, there can easily seem to be no reason to it.

We are now more used to thinking that the emotions are rational, partly because we now distinguish the cause of an emotion from its target. If one looks at what emotions are caused by an artwork, not all of these need target the artwork itself, but instead what is merely associated with it. So what the subjective approach centrally overlooks are questions to do with attention, relevance, and understanding. With those as controlling features we get a basis for normalizing the expected audience’s emotions in connection with the artwork, and so move away from purely personal judgments such as “Well, it saddened me” to more universal assessments like “it was sad.”

And with the “it” more focused on the artwork we also start to see the significance of the objective emotional features it metaphorically possesses, which were what Embodiment theorists like Hospers settled on as central. Hospers, following Bouwsma, claimed that the sadness of some music, for instance, concerns not what is evoked in us, nor any feeling experienced by the composer, but simply its physiognomic similarity to humans when sad: “it will be slow not tripping; it will be low not tinkling. People who are sad move more slowly, and when they speak they speak softly and low.” This was also a point of view developed at length by the gestalt psychologist Rudolph Arnheim.

The discriminations do not stop there, however. Guy Sircello, against Hospers, pointed out first that there are two ways emotions may be embodied in artworks: because of their form (which is what Hospers chiefly had in mind), and because of their content. Thus, a picture may be sad not because of its mood or color, but because its subject matter or topic is pathetic or miserable. That point was only a prelude, however, to an even more radical criticism of Embodiment theories by Sircello. For emotion words can also be applied, he said, on account of the “artistic acts” performed by the artists in presenting their attitude to their subject. If we look upon an artwork from this perspective, we are seeing it as a “symptom” in Suzanne Langer’s terms; however, Langer believed one should see it as a “symbol” holding some meaning which can be communicated to others.

Communication theorists all combine the three elements above, namely the audience, the artwork, and the artist, but they come in a variety of stamps. Thus, while Clive Bell and Roger Fry were Formalists, they were also Communication Theorists. They supposed that an artwork transmitted “aesthetic emotion” from the artist to the audience on account of its “significant form.” Leo Tolstoi was also a communication theorist but of almost the opposite sort. What had to be transmitted, for Tolstoi, was expressly what was excluded by Bell and (to a lesser extent) Fry, namely the “emotions of life.” Tolstoi wanted art to serve a moral purpose: helping to bind communities together in their fellowship and common humanity under God. Bell and Fry saw no such social purpose in art, and related to this difference were their opposing views regarding the value of aesthetic properties and pleasure. These were anathema to Tolstoi, who, like Plato, thought they led to waste; but the “exalted” feelings coming from the appreciation of pure form were celebrated by Bell and Fry, since their “metaphysical hypothesis” claimed it put one in touch with “ultimate reality.” Bell said, “What is that which is left when we have stripped a thing of all sensations, of all its significance as a means? What but that which philosophers used to call ‘the thing in itself’ and now call ‘ultimate reality’.”

This debate between moralists and aesthetes continues to this day with, for instance, Noël Carroll supporting a “Moderate Moralism” while Anderson and Dean support “Moderate Autonomism.” Autonomism wants aesthetic value to be isolated from ethical value, whereas Moralism sees them as more intimately related.

Communication theorists generally compare art to a form of Language. Langer was less interested than the above theorists in legislating what may be communicated, and was instead concerned to discriminate different art languages, and the differences between art languages generally and verbal languages. She said, in brief, that art conveyed emotions of various kinds, while verbal language conveyed thoughts, which was a point made by Tolstoy too. But Langer spelled out the matter in far finer detail. Thus, she held that art languages were “presentational” forms of expression, while verbal languages were “discursive”— with Poetry, an art form using verbal language, combining both aspects, of course. Somewhat like Hospers and Bouwsma, Langer said that art forms presented feelings because they were “morphologically similar” to them: an artwork, she held, shared the same form as the feeling it symbolizes. This gave rise to the main differences between presentational and discursive modes of communication: verbal languages had a vocabulary, a syntax, determinate meanings, and the possibility of translation, but none of these were guaranteed for art languages, according to Langer. Art languages revealed “what it is like” to experience something— they created “virtual experiences.”

The detailed ways in which this arises with different art forms Langer explained in her 1953 book Feeling and Form. Scruton followed Langer in several ways, notably by remarking that the experience of each art form is sui generis, that is, “each of its own kind.” He also spelled out the characteristics of a symbol in even more detail. Discussions of questions specific to each art form have been pursued by many other writers; see, for instance, Dickie, Sclafani, and Roblin, and the recent book by Gordon Graham.

8. Representation

Like the concept of Expression, the concept of Representation has been very thoroughly examined since the professionalization of Philosophy in the twentieth century.

Isn’t representation just a matter of copying? If representation could be understood simply in terms of copying, that would require “the innocent eye,” that is, one which did not incorporate any interpretation. E. H. Gombrich was the first to point out that modes of representation are, by contrast, conventional, and therefore have a cultural, socio-historical base. Thus perspective, which one might view as merely mechanical, is only a recent way of representing space, and many photographs distort what we take to be reality— for instance, those from the ground of tall buildings, which seem to make them incline inwards at the top.

Goodman, too, recognized that depiction was conventional; he likened it to denotation, that is, the relation between a word and what it stands for. He also gave a more conclusive argument against copying being the basis of representation. For that would make resemblance a type of representation, whereas if a resembles b, then b resembles a— yet a dog does not represent its picture. In other words, Goodman is saying that resemblance implies a symmetric relationship, but representation does not. As a result, Goodman made the point that representation is not a craft but an art: we create pictures of things, achieving a view of those things by representing them as this or as that. As a result, while one sees the objects depicted, the artist’s thoughts about those objects may also be discerned, as with Sircello’s “artistic arts.” The plain idea that just objects are represented in a picture was behind Richard Wollheim’s account of representational art in the first edition of his book Art and Its Objects (1968). There, the paint in a picture was said to be “seen as” an object. But in the book’s second edition, Wollheim augmented this account to allow for what is also “seen in” the work, which includes such things as the thoughts of the artist.

There are philosophical questions of another kind, however, with respect to the representation of objects, because of the problematic nature of fictions. There are three broad categories of object which might be represented: individuals which exist, like Napoleon; types of thing which exist, like kangaroos; and things which do not exist, like Mr. Pickwick, and unicorns. Goodman’s account of representation easily allowed for the first two categories, since, if depictions are like names, the first two categories of painting compare, respectively, with the relations between the proper name “Napoleon” and the person Napoleon, and the common name “kangaroo” and the various kangaroos. Some philosophers would think that the third category was as easily accommodated, but Goodman, being an Empiricist (and so concerned with the extensional world), was only prepared to countenance existent objects. So for him pictures of fictions did not denote or represent anything; instead, they were just patterns of various sorts. Pictures of unicorns were just shapes, for Goodman, which meant that he saw the description “picture of a unicorn” as unarticulated into parts. What he preferred to call a “unicorn-picture” was merely a design with certain named shapes within it. One needs to allow there are “intensional” objects as well as extensional ones before one can construe “picture of a unicorn’ as parallel to “picture of a kangaroo.” By contrast with Goodman, Scruton is one philosopher more happy with this kind of construal. It is a construal generally more congenial to Idealists, and to Realists of various persuasions, than to Empiricists.

The contrast between Empiricists and other types of philosopher also bears on other central matters to do with fictions. Is a fictional story a lie about this world, or a truth about some other? Only if one believes there are other worlds, in some kind of way, will one be able to see much beyond untruths in stories. A Realist will settle for there being “fictional characters,” often enough, about which we know there are some determinate truths— wasn’t Mr. Pickwick fat? But one difficulty then is knowing things about Mr. Pickwick other than what Dickens tells us— was Mr. Pickwick fond of grapes, for instance? An Idealist will be more prepared to consider fictions as just creatures of our imaginations. This style of analysis has been particularly prominent recently, with Scruton essaying a general theory of the imagination in which statements like “Mr. Pickwick was fat” are entertained in an “unasserted” fashion. One problem with this style of analysis is explaining how we can have emotional relations with, and responses to, fictional entities. We noticed this kind of problem before, in Burke’s description “delightful horror”: how can audiences get pleasure from tragedies and horror stories when, if those same events were encountered in real life, they would surely be anything but pleasurable? On the other hand, unless we believe that fictions are real, how can we, for instance, be moved by the fate of Anna Karenina? Colin Radford, in 1975, wrote a celebrated paper on this matter which concluded that the “paradox of emotional response to fiction” was unsolvable: adult emotional responses to fictions were “brute facts,” but they were still incoherent and irrational, he said. Radford defended this conclusion in a series of further papers in what became an extensive debate. Kendall Walton, in his 1990 book Mimesis and Make-Believe, pursued at length an Idealist’s answer to Radford. At a play, for instance, Walton said the audience enters into a form of pretence with the actors, not believing, but making believe that the portrayed events and emotions are real.

9. Art Objects

What kind of thing is a work of art? Goodman, Wollheim, Wolterstorff, and Margolis have been notable contributors to the contemporary debate.

We must first distinguish the artwork from its notation or “recipe,” and from its various physical realizations. Examples would be: some music, its score, and its performances; a drama, its script, and its performances; an etching, its plate, and its prints; and a photograph, its negative, and its positives. The notations here are “digital” in the first two cases, and “analogue” in the second two, since they involve discrete elements like notes and words in the one case, and continuous elements like lines and color patches in the other. Realizations can also be divided into two broad types, as these same examples illustrate: there are those that arise in time (performance works) and those that arise in space (object works). Realizations are always physical entities. Sometimes there is only one realization, as with architect-designed houses, couturier-designed dresses, and many paintings, and Wollheim concluded that in these cases the artwork is entirely physical, consisting of that one, unique realization. However, a number a copies were commonly made of paintings in the middle ages, and it is theoretically possible to replicate even expensive clothing and houses.

Philosophical questions in this area arise mainly with respect to the ontological status of the idea which gets executed. Wollheim brought in Charles Peirce’s distinction between types and tokens, as an answer to this: the number of different tokens of letters (7), and different types of letter (5), in the string “ABACDEC,” indicates the difference. Realizations are tokens, but ideas are types, that is, categories of objects. There is a normative connection between them as Margolis and Nicholas Wolterstorff have explained, since the execution of ideas is an essentially social enterprise.

That also explains how the need for a notation arises: one which would link not only the idea with its execution, but also the various functionaries. Broadly, there are the creative persons who generate the ideas, which are transmitted by means of a recipe to manufacturers who generate the material objects and performances. “Types are created, particulars are made” it has been said, but the link is through the recipe. Schematically, two main figures are associated with the production of many artworks: the architect and the builder, the couturier and the dressmaker, the composer and the performer, the choreographer and the dancer, the script-writer and the actor, and so forth. But a much fuller list of operatives is usually involved, as is very evident with the production of films, and other similar large entertainments. Sometimes the director of a film is concerned to control all its aspects, when we get the notion of an “auteur” who can be said to be the author of the work, but normally, creativity and craft thread through the whole production process, since even those designated “originators” still work within certain traditions, and no recipe can limit entirely the end product.

The associated philosophical question concerns the nature of any creativity. There is not much mystery about the making of particulars from some recipe, but much more needs to be said about the process of originating some new idea. For creation is not just a matter of getting into an excited mental state— as in a “brainstorming” session, for instance. That is a central part of the “creative process theory,” a form of which is to be found in the work of Collingwood. It was in these terms that Collingwood distinguished the artist from the craftsperson, namely with reference to what the artist was capable of generating just in his or her mind. But the major difficulty with this kind of theory is that any novelty has to be judged externally in terms of the artist’s social place amongst other workers in the field, as Jack Glickman has shown. Certainly, if it is to be an original idea, the artist cannot know beforehand what the outcome of the creative process will be. But others might have had the same idea before, and if the outcome was known already, then the idea thought up was not original in the appropriate sense. Thus the artist will not be credited with ownership in such cases. Creation is not a process, but a public achievement: it is a matter of breaking the tape ahead of others in a certain race.

10. References and Further Reading

  • Arnheim, R.1954, Art and Visual Perception. University of California Press, Berkeley.
    • A study of physiognomic properties from the viewpoint of gestalt psychology.
  • Beardsley, M.C. 1958, Aesthetics, Harcourt Brace, New York.
    • The classic mid-twentieth century text, with a detailed, practical study of the principles of art criticism.
  • Bell, C. 1914, Art, Chatto and Windus, London.
    • Manifesto for Formalism defending both his Aesthetic Hypothesis, and his Metaphysical Hypothesis.
  • Best, D. 1976, Philosophy and Human Movement, Allen and Unwin, London.
    • Applies aesthetic principles to Sport, and assesses its differences from Art.
  • Bourdieu, P. 1984, Distinction, trans. R.Nice, Routledge and Kegan Paul, London.
    • Studies contemporary French taste empirically, with special attention to the place of the “disinterested” class.
  • Carroll, N 1990, The Philosophy of Horror; or, Paradoxes of the Heart, Routledge, London and New York.
    • Investigation into the form and aesthetics of horror film and fiction, including discussion of the paradox of emotional response to fiction and the paradox of “horror-pleasure”.
  • Collingwood, R.G. 1958, The Principles of Art, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
    • Argues for important theses about Creativity, Art versus Craft, and Self-Expression.
  • Cooper, D. E. (ed.) 1995, A Companion to Aesthetics, Blackwell, Oxford.
    • Short notes about many aspects of, and individuals in Art and aesthetic theory.
  • Crawford, D.W. 1974, Kant’s Aesthetic Theory, University of Wisconsin Press, Madison.
    • Commentary on Kant’s third critique.
  • Curtler, H. (ed.) 1983, What is Art? Haven, New York.
    • Collects a number of papers discussing Beardsley’s aesthetics.
  • Danto, A. C. 1981, The Transfiguration of the Commonplace, Harvard University Press, Cambridge MA.
    • Contains Danto’s developed views about the influence of art theory.
  • Davies, S. 1991, Definitions of Art, Cornell University Press, Ithaca.
    • Contains a thorough study of the respective worth of Beardsley’s, and Dickie’s recent definitions of art.
  • Dickie, G. 1974, Art and the Aesthetic: An Institutional Analysis, Cornell University Press, Ithaca.
    • Dickie’s first book on his definition of Art.
  • Dickie, G. 1984, The Art Circle, Haven, New York.
    • Dickie’s later thoughts about his definition of Art.
  • Dickie, G. 1996, The Century of Taste, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
    • Contains a useful discussion of Hutcheson, Hume, and Kant, and some of their contemporaries.
  • Dickie, G., Sclafani, R.R., and Roblin, R. (eds) 1989, Aesthetics a Critical Anthology, 2nd ed. St Martin’s Press, New York.
    • Collection of papers on historic and contemporary Aesthetics, including ones on the individual arts.
  • Eagleton, T. 1990, The Ideology of the Aesthetic, Blackwell, Oxford.
    • A study of Aesthetics from the eighteenth century onwards, from the point of view of a Marxist, with particular attention to German thinkers.
  • Freeland, C. 2001, But Is it Art?, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
    • Discusses why innovation and controversy are valued in the arts, weaving together philosophy and art theory.
  • Gaut, B. and Lopes, D.M. (eds) 2001, The Routledge Companion to Aesthetics, Routledge, London and New York.
    • A series of short articles on most aspects of aesthetics, including discussions of the individual arts.
  • Gombrich, E.H. 1960, Art and Illusion, Pantheon Books, London.
    • Historical survey of techniques of pictorial representation, with philosophical commentary.
  • Goodman, N. 1968, Languages of Art, Bobbs-Merrill, Indianapolis.
    • Discusses the nature of notations, and the possibility of fakes.
  • Graham, G. 1997, Philosophy of the Arts; an Introduction to Aesthetics, Routledge, London.
    • Has separate chapters on Music, Painting and Film, Poetry and Literature, and Architecture.
  • Hanfling, O. (ed.) 1992, Philosophical Aesthetics, Blackwell, Oxford.
    • Summary papers on the core issues in Aesthetics, prepared for the Open University.
  • Hauser, A.1982, The Sociology of Art, Chicago University Press, Chicago.
    • Major historical study of Art’s place in society over the ages.
  • Hjort, M. and Laver, S. (eds) 1997, Emotion and the Arts, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
    • Papers on various aspects of art and emotion.
  • Hospers (ed) 1969, Introductory Readings in Aesthetics, Macmillan, New York.
    • Collection of major papers, including Stolnitz and Dickie on aesthetic attitudes, Hospers on Expression, and Bell, Fry, Langer and Beardsley about their various theories.
  • Hospers, J. (ed.) 1971, Artistic Expression, Appleton-Century-Crofts, New York.
    • Large collection of historical readings on Expression.
  • Kant, I. 1964, The Critique of Judgement, trans. J.C.Meredith, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
    • The original text of Kant’s third critique.
  • Iseminger, G. (ed.) 1992, Intention and Interpretation, Temple University Press, Philadelphia.
    • Contains papers by Hirsch, and Knapp and Michaels, amongst others, updating the debate over Intention.
  • Kelly, M. (ed.) 1998, Encyclopedia of Aesthetics, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
    • Four volumes not just on Philosophical Aesthetics, but also on historical, sociological, and biographical aspects of Art and Aesthetics worldwide.
  • Langer, S. 1953, Feeling and Form, Routledge and Kegan Paul, London.
    • Detailed study of the various art forms, and their different modes of expression.
  • Langer, S. 1957, Problems in Art, Routledge and Kegan Paul, London.
  • Langer, S. 1957, Philosophy in a New Key, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, MA.
    • Langer’s more theoretical writings.
  • Levinson, J. (ed.) 1998, Aesthetics and Ethics, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.
    • Contains papers by Carroll, and Anderson and Dean, amongst others, updating the debate over aestheticism.
  • Manns, J.W. 1998, Aesthetics, M.E.Sharpe, Armonk.
    • Recent monograph covering the main topics in the subject.
  • Margolis, J. (ed.) 1987, Philosophy Looks at the Arts, 3rd ed., Temple University Press, Philadelphia.
    • Central papers in recent Aesthetics, including many of the core readings discussed in the text.
  • Mothersill, M. 1984, Beauty Restored, Clarendon, Oxford.
    • Argues for a form of Aesthetic Realism, against Sibley, and with a discussion of Hume and Kant.
  • Richards, I. A. 1970, Poetries and Sciences, Routledge and Kegan Paul, London.
    • Defends a subjectivist view of Art.
  • Scruton, R.1974, Art and Imagination, Methuen, London.
    • A sophisticated and very detailed theory of most of the major concepts in Aesthetics.
  • Sheppard, A. D. R. 1987, Aesthetics: an Introduction to the Philosophy of Art, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
    • An introductory monograph on the whole subject.
  • Taylor, R. 1981, Beyond Art, Harvester, Brighton.
    • Defends the right of different classes to their own tastes.
  • Tolstoi, L. 1960, What is Art? Bobbs-Merrill, Indianapolis.
    • Tolstoi’s theory of Art and Aesthetics.
  • Walton, K.L. 1990, Mimesis as Make Believe, Harvard University Press, Cambridge MA.
    • A thorough view of many arts, motivated by the debate over emotional responses to fictions.
  • Wolff, J. 1993, Aesthetics and the Sociology of Art, 2nd ed., University of Michigan Press, Ann Arbor.
    • On the debate between objective aesthetic value, and sociological relativism.
  • Wollheim, R. 1980, Art and its Objects, 2nd ed. Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.
    • A philosophical study of the nature of art objects.
  • Wolterstorff, N. 1980, Works and Worlds of Art, Clarendon, Oxford.
    • A very comprehensive study.

Author Information

Barry Hartley Slater
University of Western Australia

Immanuel Kant: Aesthetics

kant2Immanuel Kant is an 18th century German philosopher whose work initated dramatic changes in the fields of epistemology, metaphysics, ethics, aesthetics, and teleology. Like many Enlightenment thinkers, he holds our mental faculty of reason in high esteem; he believes that it is our reason that invests the world we experience with structure. In his works on aesthetics and teleology, he argues that it is our faculty of judgment that enables us to have experience of beauty and grasp those experiences as part of an ordered, natural world with purpose. After the Introduction, each of the above sections commences with a summary. These will give the reader an idea of what topics are discussed in more detail in each section. They can also be read together to form a brief bird's-eye-view of Kant's theory of aesthetics and teleology.

Kant believes he can show that aesthetic judgment is not fundamentally different from ordinary theoretical cognition of nature, and he believes he can show that aesthetic judgment has a deep similarity to moral judgment. For these two reasons, Kant claims he can demonstrate that the physical and moral universes – and the philosophies and forms of thought that present them – are not only compatible, but unified.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. Kant's Life and Works
    2. The Central Problems of the Critique of Judgment
  2. Kant's Aesthetics
    1. The Judgment of the Beautiful
    2. The Deduction of Taste
    3. The Sublime
    4. Fine Art and Genius
    5. Idealism, Morality and the Supersensible
  3. Kant's Teleology
    1. Objective Purposiveness and Science
    2. 'The Peculiarity of the Human Understanding'
    3. The Final Purpose and Kant's Moral Argument for the Existence of God
  4. The Problem of the Unity of Philosophy and its Supersensible Objects
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Kant
    2. Other Primary and Secondary Works

1. Introduction

a. Kant's Life and Works

Immanuel Kant is often said to have been the greatest philosopher since the Greeks. Certainly, he dominates the last two hundred years in the sense that - although few philosophers today are strictly speaking Kantians - his influence is everywhere. Moreover, that influence extends over a number of different philosophical regions: epistemology, metaphysics, aesthetics, ethics, politics, religion. Because of Kant's huge importance, and the variety of his contributions and influences, this encyclopedia entry is divided into a number of subsections. What follows here will be a brief account of Kant's life and works, followed by an overview of those themes that Kant felt bridged his philosophical works, and made them into one 'critical philosophy'.

Kant was born in Königsberg, Prussia (now Kalingrad in Russia) in 1724 to Pietist Lutheran parents. His early education first at a Pietist school and then at the University of Königsberg was in theology, but he soon became attracted by problems in physics, and especially the work of Isaac Newton. In 1746 financial difficulties forced him to withdraw from the University. After nine years supporting himself as a tutor to the children of several wealthy families in outlying districts, he returned to the University, finishing his degree and entering academic life, though at first (and for many years) in the modest capacity of a lecturer. (Only in 1770 was he given a University chair in logic and metaphysics at Königsberg.) He continued to work and lecture on, and publish widely, on a great variety of issues, but especially on physics and on the metaphysical issues behind physics and mathematics. He rarely left his home city, and gradually became a celebrity there for his brilliant, witty but eccentric character.

Kant's early work was in the tradition (although not dogmatically even then) of the great German rationalist philosopher Leibniz, and especially his follower Wolff. But by the 1760s, he was increasingly admiring Leibniz's great rival Newton, and was coming under the additional influences of the empiricist skepticism of Hume and the ethical and political thought of Rousseau. In this period he produced a series of works attacking Leibnizian thought. In particular, he now argued that the traditional tools of philosophy - logic and metaphysics - had to be understood to be severely limited with respect to obtaining knowledge of reality. (Similar, apparently skeptical, claims were relatively common in the Enlightenment.)

It was only in the late 1760s, and especially in his Inaugural Dissertation of 1770 that Kant began to move towards the ideas that would make him famous and change the face of philosophy. In the Dissertation, he argued for three key new ideas: first, that sensible and conceptual presentations of the world (for example, my seeing three horses, and my concept of three) must be understood to be two quite distinct sources of possible knowledge. Second, it follows that knowledge of sensible reality is only possible if the necessary concepts (such as substance) are already available to the intellect. This fact, Kant argued, also limits the legitimate range of application of these concepts. Finally, Kant claimed that sensible presentations were of only appearances', and not things as they are in themselves. This was because space and time, which describe the basic structure of all sensible appearances, are not existent in things in themselves, but are only a product of our organs of sense. Perceiving things in space and time is a function of the mind of the perceiver. The hypothesis that both key concepts, and the basic structure of space and time, are a priori in the mind, is a basic theme of Kant's idealism (see the entry on 'Kant's Metaphysics'). It is important to recognize that this last claim about space and time also exacerbates the limitation imposed above by proposing a whole realm of 'noumena' or 'things in themselves' which necessarily lies beyond knowledge in any ordinary sense. These new and often startling ideas, with a few important modifications, would form the basis of his philosophical project for the rest of his life.

After publishing quite often in the preceding 15 years, the Dissertation ushered in an apparently quiet phase in Kant's work. Kant realized that he had discovered a new way of thinking. He now needed rigorous demonstrations of his new ideas, and had to pursue their furthest implications. He even needed to find a new philosophical language to properly express such original thoughts! This took more than a decade of his life. Except for a remarkable set of correspondence during this period, Kant published nothing until the massive first edition of the Critique of Pure Reason, in 1781 (revised second edition, 1787).

Over the next two decades, however, he furiously pursued his new philosophy into different territories, producing books or shorter publications on virtually every philosophical topic under the sun. This new philosophy came to be known as 'critical' or 'transcendental' philosophy. Of particular importance were the so called three Critiques: The Critique of Pure Reason (1781/1787), Critique of Practical Reason (1788), and the Critique of Judgment (1790). Kant quickly became famous in the German speaking world, and soon thereafter elsewhere. This fame did not mean universal praise, however. Kant's work was feverishly debated in all circles - his work on religion and politics was even censored. And by the time of his death in 1804, philosophers such as Fichte, Schelling and the Hegel were already striking out in new philosophical directions. Directions, however, that would have been unthinkable without Kant.

b. The Central Problems of the Critique of Judgment

Kant's Critique of Judgment (the third Critique) was and continues to be a surprise - even to Kant, for it emerged out of Kant's philosophical activity having not been a part of the original plan. (For an account of Kant's first two Critiques, please see the entry on 'Kant's Metaphysics'.) Some philosophers have even claimed that it is the product of the onset of senility in Kant. After initial enthusiasm during the romantic period, the book was relatively ignored until work such as Cassirer's in the early 20th Century. Especially in the last few decades, however, the Critique of Judgment is being increasingly seen as a major and profound work in Kant's output.

Part of the surprise lies in the diversity of topics Kant deals with. For much of the previous two centuries the book was read - and it still is largely read in this way - as a book about aesthetics (the philosophy of the beautiful and the sublime). In fact this type of reading by no means adequately reflects Kant's explicit themes, and is forced to ignore much of the text. Here, we shall try to sketch out the range of topics and purposes (including aesthetics) Kant gives to his third Critique.

There are several commonly available translations of the Critique of Judgment. Here, we will use Werner S. Pluhar's (Hackett, 1987), but will make reference alternative translations of key terms, especially as found in the widely used James Creed Meredith translation. To facilitate the use of the variety of available editions, passages in Kant's text will be indicated by section number, rather than page number.

The basic, explicit purpose of Kant's Critique of Judgment is to investigate whether the 'power' (also translated as 'faculty' - and we will use the latter here) of judgment provides itself with an priori principle. In earlier work, Kant had pretty much assumed that judgment was simply a name for the combined operation of other, more fundamental, mental faculties. Now, Kant has been led to speculate that the operation of judgment might be organized and directed by a fundamental a priori principle that is unique to it. The third Critique sets out to explore the validity and implications of such a hypothesis.

In the third Critique, Kant's account of judgment begins with the definition of judgment as the subsumption of a particular under a universal (Introduction IV). If, in general, the faculty of understanding is that which supplies concepts (universals), and reason is that which draws inferences (constructs syllogisms, for example), then judgment 'mediates' between the understanding and reason by allowing individual acts of subsumption to occur (cf. e.g. Introduction III). This leads Kant to a further distinction between determinate and reflective judgments (Introduction IV). In the former, the concept is sufficient to determine the particular - meaning that the concept contains sufficient information for the identification of any particular instance of it. In such a case, judgment's work is fairly straightforward (and Kant felt he had dealt adequately with such judgments in the Critique of Pure Reason). Thus the latter (where the judgment has to proceed without a concept, sometimes in order to form a new concept) forms the greater philosophical problem here. How could a judgment take place without a prior concept? How are new concepts formed? And are there judgments that neither begin nor end with determinate concepts? This explains why a book about judgment should have so much to say about aesthetics: Kant takes aesthetic judgments to be a particularly interesting form of reflective judgments.

As we shall see, the second half of Kant's book deals with teleological judgments. Broadly speaking, a teleological judgment concerns an object the possibility of which can only be understood from the point of view of its purpose. Kant will claim that teleological judgments are also reflective, but in a different way - that is, having a different indeterminacy with respect to the concepts typical of natural science.

Reflective judgments are important for Kant because they involve the judgment doing a job for itself, rather than being a mere co-ordinator of concepts and intuitions; thus, reflective judgments might be the best place to search for judgment's a priori legislating principle. The principle in question (if it exists), Kant claims, would assert the suitability of all nature for our faculty of judgment in general. (In the narrower case of determinate judgments, Kant believes he has demonstrated the necessity of this 'suitability' - please see the entry on 'Kant's Metaphysics'.) This general suitability Kant calls the finality or purposiveness/ purposefulness of nature for the purposes of our judgment. Kant offers a number of arguments to prove the existence and validity of this principle. First, he suggests that without such a principle, science (as a systematic, orderly and unified conception of nature) would not be possible. All science must assume the availability of its object for our ability to judge it. (A similar argument is used by Kant in the Critique of Pure Reason in discussing the regulative role of rational ideas (see A642-668=B670-696)). Second, without such a principle our judgments about beauty would not exhibit the communicability, or tendency to universality even in the absence of a concept, that they do. It is this second argument that dominates the first half of the Critique of Judgment.

As we shall see, Kant uses the particular investigation into judgments about art, beauty and the sublime partly as a way of illuminating judgment in general. Aesthetic judgments exhibit in an exemplary fashion precisely those features of judgment in general which allow one to explore the transcendental principles of judgment. But Kant has still higher concerns. The whole problem of judgment is important because judgment, Kant believes, forms the mediating link between the two great branches of philosophical inquiry (the theoretical and the practical). It had been noted before (for example, by Hume) that there seems to be a vast difference between what is, and what ought to be. Kant notes that these two philosophical branches have completely different topics, but these topics, paradoxically, have as their object the very same sensible nature. Theoretical philosophy has as its topic the cognition of sensible nature; practical philosophy has as its topic the possibility of moral action in and on sensible nature.

This problem had arisen before in Kant's work, in the famous Antinomies in both the first and second Critiques. A key version of the problem Kant poses in the Antinomies concerns freedom: how can nature be both determined according to the laws of science, and yet have 'room' for the freedom necessary in order for morality to have any meaning? Ultimately, for Kant this would be a conflict of our faculty of reason against itself. For, in its theoretical employment, reason absolutely demands the subjection of all objects to law; but in its practical (moral) employment, reason equally demands the possibility of freedom. The problem is solved by returning to the idealism we discussed in previous section of the introduction. Every object has to be conceived in a two-fold manner: first as an appearance, subject to the necessary jurisdiction of certain basic concepts (the Categories) and to the forms of space and time; second, as a thing in itself, about which nothing more can be said. Even if appearances are rigorously law-governed, it is still possible that things in themselves can act freely. Nevertheless, although this solution eliminates the conflict, it does not actually unify the two sides of reason, nor the two objects (what is and what ought) of reason.

Judgment seems to relate to both sides, however, and thus (Kant speculates) can form the third thing that allows philosophy to be a single, unified discipline. Kant thus believes that judgment may be the mediating link that can unify the whole of philosophy, and correlatively, also the link that discovers the unity among the objects and activities of philosophy. Unfortunately, Kant never makes explicit exactly how the bulk of his third Critique is supposed to solve this problem; understandably, it is thus often ignored by readers of Kant's text. Thus, the central problem of the Critique of Judgment is a broad one: the unity of philosophy in general. This problem is investigated by that mental faculty which Kant believes is the key to this unity, namely judgment. And judgment is investigated by the critical inquiry into those types of judgment in which the a priori principle of judgment is apparent: on the beautiful, on the sublime, and on teleology. We shall return to the grand issue of the unity of philosophy at the end of this article.

The various themes of the Critique of Judgment have been enormously influential in the two centuries since its publication. The accounts of genius, and of the significance of imagination in aesthetics, for example, became basic pillars of Romanticism in the early 19th Century. The formalism of Kant's aesthetics in general inspired two generations of formalist aesthetics, in the first half of the 20th Century; the connection between judgment and political or moral communities has been similarly influential from Schiller onwards, and was the main subject of Hanna Arendt's last, uncompleted, project; and Kant's treatment of the sublime has been a principle object of study by several recent philosophers, such as J.-F. Lyotard. Kant's discussion, in the second half of the book, of the distinction between the intellectus ectypus and the intellectus archetypus was an extremely important in the decades immediately after Kant in the development of German Idealism. And his moral proof for the existence of God is often ranked alongside the great arguments of Anselm and Aquinas.

The following entry is divided into two sections, which correspond for the most part to the major division of Kant's book between the 'Critique of Aesthetic Judgment' and the 'Critique of Teleological Judgment'. Part A deals with Kant's account of beauty, the sublime, and fine art. In the first two of these subjects, Kant's concern is with what features an aesthetic judgment exhibits, how such a judgment is possible, and is there any transcendental guarantee of the validity of such a judgment. The treatment of fine art shifts the focus onto the conditions of possibility of the production of works of art. Part B deals with Kant's account of teleological judgment, and its relation to the natural science of biology. However, if the discussion above of the 'Central Problems' of the Critique of Judgment is correct, a major part of Kant's interest is less in these particular analyses, than in their broader implications for e.g. morality, the nature of human thought, our belief in the existence of God, and ultimately for the unity of philosophy itself. We will be dealing with these implications throughout, but especially in sections A5, B2, B3 and B4.

2. Kant's Aesthetics

a. The Judgment of the Beautiful

Overview: The Critique of Judgment begins with an account of beauty. The initial issue is: what kind of judgment is it that results in our saying, for example, 'That is a beautiful sunset'. Kant argues that such aesthetic judgments (or 'judgments of taste') must have four key distinguishing features. First, they are disinterested, meaning that we take pleasure in something because we judge it beautiful, rather than judging it beautiful because we find it pleasurable. The latter type of judgment would be more like a judgment of the 'agreeable', as when I say 'I like doughnuts'.

Second and third, such judgments are both universal and necessary. This means roughly that it is an intrinsic part of the activity of such a judgment to expect others to agree with us. Although we may say 'beauty is in the eye of the beholder', that is not how we act. Instead, we debate and argue about our aesthetic judgments - and especially about works of art -and we tend to believe that such debates and arguments can actually achieve something. Indeed, for many purposes, 'beauty' behaves as if it were a real property of an object, like its weight or chemical composition. But Kant insists that universality and necessity are in fact a product of features of the human mind (Kant calls these features 'common sense'), and that there is no objective property of a thing that makes it beautiful.

Fourth, through aesthetic judgments, beautiful objects appear to be 'purposive without purpose' (sometimes translated as 'final without end'). An object's purpose is the concept according to which it was made (the concept of a vegetable soup in the mind of the cook, for example); an object is purposive if it appears to have such a purpose; if, in other words, it appears to have been made or designed. But it is part of the experience of beautiful objects, Kant argues, that they should affect us as if they had a purpose, although no particular purpose can be found.

Having identified the major features of aesthetic judgments, Kant then needs to ask the question of how such judgments are possible, and are such judgments in any way valid (that is, are they really universal and necessary).

It is useful to see the aesthetics here, as with Kant's epistemology and to a certain extent his ethics also, as being a leap over the terms of the debate between British (and largely empiricist) philosophy of art and beauty (Shaftesbury, Hutcheson, Hume and Burke) and Continental rationalist aesthetics (especially Baumgarten, who invented the modern use of the term aesthetics' in the mid-18th century). The key ideas of the former group were (i) the idea of a definite human nature, such that studies of beauty could, within limits, be universal in scope; (ii) the assertion that beautiful objects and our responses to them were essentially involved in sense or feeling, and were not cognitive; (iii) that any 'natural' responses to beauty were generally overlaid by individual and communal experiences, habits and customs. The main disagreement with rationalist thought on the matter was in the second of these ideas. Baumgarten, following Leibniz, argued that all sense perception was merely 'confused' cognition, or cognition by way of sensible images. Thus, although beauty certainly appears to our senses, this by no means demonstrates that beauty is non-cognitive! Beauty, for Baumgarten, has more to do with rational ideas such as harmony, rather than with the physiological.

Kant asserted the basic distinction between intuitive or sensible presentations on the one hand, and the conceptual or rational on the other. (See 'Kant's Transcendental Idealism' in the article on 'Kant's Metaphysics'.) Therefore, despite his great admiration for Baumgarten, it is impossible for Kant to agree with Baumgarten's account of aesthetic experience. (By 'aesthetic' here we mean in Baumgarten's sense of a philosophy of the beautiful and related notions, and not in Kant's original usage of the term in the Critique of Pure Reason to mean the domain of sensibility.) In addition, Kant holds that aesthetic experience, like natural experience leading to determinate judgments, is inexplicable without both an intuitive and a conceptual dimension. Thus, for example, beauty is also by no means non-cognitive, as the British tradition had held.

Thus, Kant begins to analyze the experience of beauty, in order to ask as precisely as possible the question 'how are judgments about beauty possible'. Kant's initial focus is on judgments about beauty in nature, as when we call a flower, a sunset, or an animal 'beautiful'. What, at bottom, does such a judgment mean, and how does it take place as a mental act? In order to begin to answer these questions, Kant needs to clarify the basic features of such judgments. On Kant's analysis, aesthetic judgments are still more strange even than ordinary reflective judgments, and must have a number of peculiar features which at first sight look like nothing other than paradoxes. We will now describe those features using Kant's conceptual language.

Taking up roughly the first fifth of the Critique of Judgment, Kant discusses four particular unique features of aesthetic judgments on the beautiful (he subsequently deals with the sublime). These he calls 'moments', and they are structured in often obscure ways according to the main divisions of Kant's table of categories (See article on Kant's Metaphysics).

The First Moment. Aesthetic judgments are disinterested. There are two types of interest: by way of sensations in the agreeable, and by way of concepts in the good. Only aesthetic judgment is free or pure of any such interests. Interest is defined as a link to real desire and action, and thus also to a determining connection to the real existence of the object. In the aesthetic judgment per se, the real existence of the beautiful object is quite irrelevant. Certainly, I may wish to own the beautiful painting, or at least a copy of it, because I derive pleasure from it - but that pleasure, and thus that desire, is distinct from and parasitic upon the aesthetic judgment (see sect;9). The judgment results in pleasure, rather than pleasure resulting in judgment. Kant accordingly and famously claims that the aesthetic judgment must concern itself only with form (shape, arrangement, rhythm, etc.) in the object presented, not sensible content (color, tone, etc.), since the latter has a deep connection to the agreeable, and thus to interest. Kant is thus the founder of all formalism in aesthetics in modern philosophy. This claim of the disinterestedness of all aesthetic judgments is perhaps the most often attacked by subsequent philosophy, especially as it is extended to include fine art as well as nature. To pick three examples, Kant's argument is rejected by those (Nietzsche, Freud) for whom all art must always be understood as related to will; by those for whom all art (as a cultural production) must be political in some sense (Marxism); by those for whom all art is a question of affective response expressionists).

The Second Moment. Aesthetic judgments behave universally, that is, involve an expectation or claim on the agreement of others - just 'as if' beauty were a real property of the object judged. If I judge a certain landscape to be beautiful then, although I may be perfectly aware that all kinds of other factors might enter in to make particular people in fact disagree with me, never-the-less I at least implicitly demand universality in the name of taste. The way that my aesthetic judgments 'behave' is key evidence here: that is, I tend to see disagreement as involving error somewhere, rather than agreement as involving mere coincidence. This universality is distinguished first from the mere subjectivity of judgments such as 'I like honey' (because that is not at all universal, nor do we expect it to be); and second from the strict objectivity of judgments such as 'honey contains sugar and is sweet', because the aesthetic judgment must, somehow, be universal 'apart from a concept' (sect;9). Being reflective judgments, aesthetic judgments of taste have no adequate concept (at least to begin with), and therefore can only behave as if they were objective. Kant is quite aware that he is flying in the face of contemporary (then and now!) truisms such as 'beauty is in the eye of the beholder'. Such a belief, he argues, first of all can not account for our experience of beauty itself, insofar as the tendency is always to see 'beauty' as if it were somehow in the object or the immediate experience of the object. Second, Kant argues that such a relativist view can not account for the social 'behavior' of our claims about what we find beautiful. In order to explore the implications of 'apart from a concept', Kant introduces the idea of the 'free play' of the cognitive faculties (here: understanding and imagination), and the related idea of communicability. In the case of the judgment of the beautiful, these faculties no longer simply work together (as they do in ordinary sensible cognition) but rather each 'furthers' or 'quickens' the other in a kind of self-contained and self-perpetuating cascade of thought and feeling. We will return to these notions below.

The Third Moment. The third introduces the problem of purpose and purposiveness (also translated 'end' and 'finality'). An object's purpose is the concept according to which it was manufactured; purposiveness, then, is the property of at least appearing to have been manufactured or designed. Kant claims that the beautiful has to be understood as purposive, but without any definite purpose. A 'definite purpose' would be either the set of external purposes (what the thing was meant to do or accomplish), or the internal purpose (what the thing was simply meant to be like). In the former case, the success of the process of making is judged according to utility; in the latter, according to perfection. Kant argues that beauty is equivalent neither to utility nor perfection, but is still purposive. Beauty in nature, then, will appear as purposive with respect to our faculty of judgment, but its beauty will have no ascertainable purpose - that is, it is not purposive with respect to determinate cognition. Indeed, this is why beauty is pleasurable since, Kant argues, pleasure is defined as a feeling that arises on the achievement of a purpose, or at least the recognition of a purposiveness (Introduction, VI).

The purposiveness of art is more complicated. Although such works may have had purposes behind their production (the artist wished to express a certain mood, or communicate a certain idea), nevertheless, these can not be sufficient for the object to be beautiful. As judges of art, any such knowledge we do have about these real purposes can inform the judgment as background, but must be abstracted from to form the aesthetic judgment properly. It is not just that the purpose for the beauty of the beautiful happens to be unknown, but that it cannot be known. Still, we are left with the problem of understanding how a thing can be purposive, without having a definite purpose.

The Fourth Moment. Here, Kant is attempting to show that aesthetic judgments must pass the test of being 'necessary', which effectively means, 'according to principle'. Everyone must assent to my judgment, because it follows from this principle. But this necessity is of a peculiar sort: it is 'exemplary' and 'conditioned'. By exemplary, Kant means that the judgment does not either follow or produce a determining concept of beauty, but exhausts itself in being exemplary precisely of an aesthetic judgment. With the notion of condition, Kant reaches the core of the matter. He is asking: what is it that the necessity of the judgment is grounded upon; that is, what does it say about those who judge?

Kant calls the ground 'common sense', by which he means the a priori principle of our taste, that is of our feeling for the beautiful. (Note: by 'common sense' is not meant being intelligent about everyday things, as in: 'For a busy restaurant, it's just common sense to reserve a table in advance.') In theoretical cognition of nature, the universal communicability of a representation, its objectivity, and its basis in a priori principles are all related. Similarly, Kant wants to claim that the universal communicability, the exemplary necessity and the basis in an a priori principle are all different ways of understanding the same subjective condition of possibility of aesthetic judgment that he calls common sense. (As we shall see, on the side of the beautiful object, this subjective principle corresponds to the principle of the purposiveness of nature.) Thus Kant can even claim that all four Moments of the Beautiful are summed up in the idea of 'common sense' (CJ sect.22). Kant also suggests that common sense in turn depends upon or is perhaps identical with the same faculties as ordinary cognition, that is, those features of humans which (as Kant showed in the Critique of Pure Reason) make possible natural, determinative experience. Here, however, the faculties are merely in a harmony rather than forming determinate cognition.

b. The Deduction of Taste

Overview: There are two aspects to Kant's basic answer to the question of how aesthetic judgments happen. First, some of Kant's earlier work seemed to suggest that our faculty or ability to judge consisted of being a mere processor of other, much more fundamental mental presentations. These were concepts and intuitions ('intuition' being Kant's word for our immediate sensible experiences - see entry on 'Kant's Metaphysics'). Everything interesting and fundamental happened in the formation of concepts, or in the receiving of intuitions. But now Kant argues that judgment itself, as a faculty, has an fundamental principle that governs it. This principle asserts the purposiveness of all phenomena with respect to our judgment. In other words, it assumes in advance that everything we experience can be tackled by our powers of judgment. Normally, we don't even notice that this assumption is being made, we just apply concepts, and be done with it. But in the case of the beautiful, we do notice. This is because the beautiful draws particular attention to its purposiveness; but also because the beautiful has no concept of a purpose available, so that we cannot just apply a concept and be done with it. Instead, the beautiful forces us to grope for concepts that we can never find. And yet, nevertheless, the beautiful is not an alien and disturbing experience - on the contrary, it is pleasurable. The principle of purposiveness is satisfied, but in a new and unique way.

Asking what this new and unique way is takes us to the second aspect. Kant argues that the kinds of 'cognition' (i.e. thinking) characteristic of the contemplation of the beautiful are not, in fact, all that different from ordinary cognition about things in the world. The faculties of the mind are the same: the 'understanding' which is responsible for concepts, and the 'sensibility' (including our imagination) which is responsible for intuitions. The difference between ordinary and aesthetic cognition is that in the latter case, there is no one 'determinate' concept that pins down an intuition. Instead, intuition is allowed some 'free play', and rather than being subject to one concept, it instead acts in 'harmony' with the lawfulness in general of the understanding. It is this ability of judgment to bring sensibility and understanding to a mutually reinforcing harmony that Kant calls 'common sense'. This account of common sense explains how the beautiful can be purposive with respect to our ability to judge, and yet have no definite purpose. Kant believes common sense also answers the question of why aesthetic judgments are valid: since aesthetic judgments are a perfectly normal function of the same faculties of cognition involved in ordinary cognition, they will have the same universal validity as such ordinary acts of cognition.

The idea of a harmony between or among the faculties of cognition is turning out to be the key idea. For such a harmony, Kant claims, will be purposive, but without purpose. Moreover, it will be both universal and necessary, because based upon universal common sense, or again, because related to the same cognitive faculties which enable any and all knowledge and experience. Lastly, because of the self-contained nature of this harmony, it must be disinterested. So, what does Kant think is going on in such 'harmony', or in common sense for that matter, and does he have any arguments which make of these idea more than mere metaphors for beauty?

Up to now, we have had no decent argument for the existence of common sense as a principle of taste. At best, common sense was plausible as a possible explanation of, for example, the tendency to universality observed in aesthetic judgments. (As Kant admits in sect.17). Such a demand for universality could be accounted for nicely if we assumed an a priori principle for taste, which might also explain the idea of universal communicability. This argument, however, is rather weak. Kant believes he has an ingenious route to proving the case with much greater certainty.

Throughout the Four Moments of the Beautiful, Kant has dropped many important clues as to the transcendental account of the possibility of aesthetic judgment: in particular, we have talked about communicability, common sense and the harmony of the cognitive sub-faculties. Kant then cuts off to turn to the sublime, representing a different problem within aesthetic judgment. He returns to beauty in sect.30, which forms the transition to the passages tantalizingly called the Deduction. These transitional passages feel much like a continuation of the Four Moments; we will treat them as such here, since also Kant claims that the sublime does not need a Deduction.

The Deduction in fact appears in two versions in Kant's texts (sect.9 and 21 being the first; sect.30-40 the second, with further important clarification in the 'Dialectic' sect.55-58). Here, we will discuss only the second. Both explicitly are attempting to demonstrate the universal communicability and thus intersubjective validity of judgments of taste. Which for Kant is the same as saying that there is a 'common sense' - by which he means that humans all must have a kind of sensing ability which operates the same way.

Briefly, the argument begins by asserting that aesthetic judgments must be judgments in some sense; that is, they are mental acts which bring a sensible particular under some universal (Kant's Introduction, IV). The four moments of the beautiful are then explicitly seen as being limitations on the conditions under which this judgment can take place (no interest, purposive without determining purpose, etc.); all these Kant summarizes by saying that the judgments are formal only, lacking all 'matter'. By this, he means that although the judgment is a judgment of the presentation of a particular (singular) object, no particular determination of either sensible intuition, or understanding forms a necessary part of the judgment. (In ordinary cognition of the world, this lack of restriction would be entirely out of place. It would be nonsense to judge whether a particular thing was a sofa without restricting my judgment to that particular thing, and to the concept of a sofa.) However, considered in general (that is, in their essence as sub-faculties) the faculties of imagination and understanding are likewise not restricted to any presentation or kind of sense, or any concept. This means that Kant is describing the 'proportion' between understanding and intuition as something like the always present possibility of the faculties being freed to mutually enact their essence.

Because such faculties in general are required for all theoretical cognition whatsoever, regardless of its object (as Kant claims to have proven in the first Critique), they can be assumed present a priori, in the same form and in the same way, in all human beings. The presence of the cognitive sub-faculties in their various relations is equivalent with the principle of the universal communicability and validity (i.e. common sense) of any mental states in which these faculties are involved a priori. Therefore, an aesthetic judgment must be seen to be an expression of this principle. The key move is obviously to claim that the aesthetic judgment rests upon the same unique conditions as ordinary cognition, and thus that the former must have the same universal communicability and validity as the latter. It is just that, presented with the beautiful, our cognitive faculties are released from the limitations that characterize ordinary thought, and produce what above we called a cascade of thoughts and feelings.

It is difficult to know what to make of this argument (with the various other versions of it scattered throughout the text) and the hypothesis it purports to prove. For one thing, Kant's work here is so heavily reliant upon the results of the first Critique as to not really be able to stand on its own, while at the same time it is not clear at several points whether the first and third Critiques are fully compatible. For another, does not all this talk about the faculties 'in general' seem as if Kant is hypostatising these faculties, as really existent things in the mind that act, rather than simply as an expression for certain capacities? However, there is no doubting the fascinating and profound implications of what Kant is proposing. For example, the notions of common sense and communicability are closely akin to key political ideas, leading several commentators to propose that what Kant is really writing about are the foundations of any just politics (see e.g. sect.60). Or again, the 'freedom' of the imagination is explicitly linked by Kant to the freedom characteristic of the moral will, allowing Kant to construct a deeply rooted link between beauty and the moral (sect.59). Finally, of course, there is K

c. The Sublime

Overview: For Kant, the other basic type of aesthetic experience is the sublime. The sublime names experiences like violent storms or huge buildings which seem to overwhelm us; that is, we feel we 'cannot get our head around them'. This is either mainly 'mathematical' - if our ability to intuit is overwhelmed by size (the huge building) - or 'dynamical' - if our ability to will or resist is overwhelmed by force (e.g. the storm). The problem for Kant here is that this experience seems to directly contradict the principle of the purposiveness of nature for our judgment. And yet, Kant notes, one would expect the feeling of being overwhelmed to also be accompanied by a feeling of fear or at least discomfort. Whereas, the sublime can be a pleasurable experience. All this raises the question of what is going on in the sublime

Kant's solution is that, in fact, the storm or the building is not the real object of the sublime at all. Instead, what is properly sublime are ideas of reason: namely, the ideas of absolute totality or absolute freedom. However huge the building, we know it is puny compared to absolute totality; however powerful the storm, it is nothing compared to absolute freedom. The sublime feeling is therefore a kind of 'rapid alternation' between the fear of the overwhelming and the peculiar pleasure of seeing that overwhelming overwhelmed. Thus, it turns out that the sublime experience is purposive after all - that we can, in some way, 'get our head around it'.

Since the ideas of reason (particularly freedom) are also important for Kant's moral theory, there seems to be an interesting connection between the sublime and morality. This Kant discusses under the heading of 'moral culture', arguing for example that the whole sublime experience would not be possible if humans had not received a moral training that taught them to recognize the importance of their own faculty of reason.

Traditionally, the sublime has been the name for objects inspiring awe, because of the magnitude of their size/height/depth (e.g. the ocean, the pyramids of Cheops), force (a storm), or transcendence (our idea of God). Vis-à-vis the beautiful, the sublime presents some unique puzzles to Kant. Three in particular are of note. First, that while the beautiful is concerned with form, the sublime may even be (or even especially be) formless. Second, that while the beautiful indicates (at least for judgment) a purposiveness of nature that may have profound implications, the sublime appears to be 'counter-purposive'. That is, the object appears ill-matched to, does 'violence' to, our faculties of sense and cognition. Finally, although from the above one might expect the sublime experience to be painful in some way, in fact the sublime does still involve pleasure - the question is 'how?'.

Kant divides the sublime into the 'mathematical' (concerned with things that have a great magnitude in and of themselves) and the 'dynamically' (things that have a magnitude of force in relation to us, particularly our will). The mathematical sublime is defined as something 'absolutely large' that is, 'large beyond all comparison' (sect.25). Usually, we apply some kind of standard of comparison, although this need not be explicit (e.g. 'Mt. Blanc is large' usually means 'compared with other mountains (or perhaps, with more familiar objects), Mt. Blanc is large'). The absolutely large, however, is not the result of a comparison

Now, of course, any object is measurable - even the size of the universe, no less a mountain on Earth. But Kant then argues that measurement not merely mathematical in nature (the counting of units), but fundamentally relies upon the 'aesthetic' (in the sense of 'intuitive' as used in the first Critique) grasp of a unit of measure. Dealing with a unit of measure, whether it be a millimeter or a kilometer, requires a number (how many units) but also a sense of what the unit is. This means that there will be absolute limits on properly aesthetic measurement because of the limitations of the finite, human faculties of sensibility. In the first place, there must be an absolute unit of measure, such that nothing larger could be 'apprehended'; in the second place, there must be a limit to the number of such units that can be held together in the imagination and thus 'comprehended' (sect.26). An object that exceeds these limits (regardless of its mathematical size) will be presented as absolutely large - although of course it is still so with respect to our faculties of sense.

However, we must return to the second and third peculiar puzzles of the sublime. As we saw above with respect to the beautiful, pleasure lies in the achievement of a purpose, or at least in the recognition of a purposiveness. So, if the sublime presents itself as counter-purposive, why and how is pleasure associated with it? In other words, where is the purposiveness of the sublime experience? Kant writes,

[W]e express ourselves entirely incorrectly when we call this or that object of nature sublime ... for how can we call something by a term of approval if we apprehend it as in itself contrapurposive? (sect.23)

This problem constitutes Kant's principle argument that something else must be going on in the sublime experience other than the mere overwhelmingness of some object. As Kant will later claim, objects of sense (oceans, pyramids, etc.) are called 'sublime' only by a kind of covert sleight-of-hand, what he calls a 'subreption' (sect.27). In fact, what is actually sublime, Kant argues, are ideas of our own reason. The overwhelmingness of sensible objects leads the minds to these ideas.

Now, such presentations of reason are necessarily unexhibitable by sense. Moreover, the faculty of reason is not merely an inert source of such ideas, but characteristically demands that its ideas be presented. (This same demand is what creates all the dialectical problems that Kant analyses in, for example, the Antinomies.) Kant claims that the relation of the overwhelming sensible object to our sense is in a kind of 'harmony' (sect.27) or analogy to the relation of the rational idea of absolute totality to any sensible object or faculty. The sublime experience, then, is a two-layer process. First, a contrapurposive layer in which our faculties of sense fail to complete their task of presentation. Second, a strangely purposive layer in which this very failure constitutes a 'negative exhibition' ('General Comment' following sect.29) of the ideas of reason (which could not otherwise be presented). This 'exhibition' thus also provides a purposiveness of the natural object for the fulfillment of the demands of reason. Moreover, and importantly, it also provides a new and 'higher' purposiveness to the faculties of sense themselves which are now understood to be properly positioned with respect to our 'supersensible vocation' (sect.27) - i.e. in the ultimately moral hierarchy of the faculties. Beyond simply comprehending individual sensible things, our faculty of sensibility, we might say, now knows what it is for. We will return to this point shortly. The consequence of this purposiveness is exactly that 'negative pleasure' (sect.23) for which we had be searching. The initial displeasure of the 'violence' against our apparent sensible interests is now matched by a 'higher' pleasure arising from the strange purposiveness Kant has discovered. Interestingly, on Kant's description, neither of these feelings wins out - instead, the sublime feeling consists of a unique 'vibration' or 'rapid alternation' of these feelings (sect.27).

The dynamically sublime is similar. In this case, a 'might' or power is observed in nature that is irresistible with respect to our bodily or sensible selves. Such an object is 'fearful' to be sure, but (because we remain disinterested) is not an object of fear. (Importantly, one of Kant's examples here is religion: God is fearful but the righteous man is not afraid. This is the difference, he says, between a rational religion and mere superstition.) Again, the sublime is a two-layered experience. Kant writes that such objects 'raise the soul's fortitude above its usual middle range and allow us to discover in ourselves an ability to resist which is of a quite different kind...' (sect.28). In particular, nature is called 'sublime merely because it elevates the imagination to the exhibition of those cases wherein the mind can be made to feel [sich fühlbar machen] the sublimity, even above nature, that is proper to its vocation' (sect.28, translation modified). In particular, the sublimity belongs to human freedom which is (by definition) unassailable to the forces of nature. Such a conception of freedom as being outside the order of nature, but demanding action upon that order, is the core of Kant's moral theory. Thus we can begin to see the intimate connection between the sublime (especially here the dynamically sublime) and morality

This connection (for the sublime in general) becomes even more explicit in Kant's discussion of what he calls 'moral culture'. (sect.29) The context is to ask about the modality of judgments on the sublime - that is, to they have the same implicit demand on the necessary assent of others that judgments on the beautiful have? Kant's answer is complicated. There is an empirical factor which is required for the sublime: the mind of the experiencer must be 'receptive' to rational ideas, and this can only happen in a culture that already understands morality as being a function of freedom or, more generally, conceives of human beings as having a dimension which in some way transcends nature. The sublime, properly speaking, is possible only for members of such a moral culture (and, Kant sometimes suggests, may reciprocally contribute to the strengthening of that culture). So, the sublime is subjected to an empirical contingency. However, Kant claims, we are justified in demanding from everyone that they necessarily have the transcendental conditions for such moral culture, and thus for the sublime, because these conditions are (as in the case of the beautiful) the same as for theoretical and practical thought in general. The claims about moral culture show that, for Kant, aesthetics in general is not an isolated problem for philosophy but intimately linked to metaphysical and moral questions. This is one more reason why it is important not to assume that the Critique of Aesthetic Judgment is a book merely about beauty and sublimity. Moreover, this 'link' has an even greater significance for Kant: it shows reflective judgment in action as it were relating together both theoretical and practical reason, for this was the grand problem he raised in his Introduction.

Kant's treatment of the sublime raises many difficulties. For example, only the dynamically sublime has any strict relationship to the moral idea of freedom. This raises the question of whether the mathematical and dynamically sublime are in fact radically different, both in themselves as experiences, and in their relation to 'moral culture'. Again, Kant gives an interesting account of how magnitude is estimated in discussing the mathematical sublime, but skips the parallel problem in the dynamically sublime (how does one estimate force?). Finally, many readers have found the premise of the whole discussion implausible: that in the sublime experience, what is properly sublime and the object of respect should be the idea of reason, rather than nature.

d. Fine Art and Genius

Overview: Thus far, Kant's main focus for the discussion of beauty and the sublime has been nature. He now turns to fine art. Kant assumes that the cognition involved in judging fine art is similar to the cognition involved in judging natural beauty. Accordingly, the problem that is new to fine art is not how it is judged by a viewer, but how it is created. The solution revolves around two new concepts: the 'genius' and 'aesthetic ideas'.

Kant argues that art can be tasteful (that is, agree with aesthetic judgment) and yet be 'soulless' - lacking that certain something that would make it more than just an artificial version of a beautiful natural object. What provides soul in fine art is an aesthetic idea. An aesthetic idea is a counterpart to a rational idea: where the latter is a concept that could never adequately be exhibited sensibly, the former is a set of sensible presentations to which no concept is adequate. An aesthetic idea, then, is as successful an attempt as possible to 'exhibit' the rational idea. It is the talent of genius to generate aesthetic ideas, but that is not all. First, the mode of expression must also be tasteful - for the understanding's 'lawfulness' is the condition of the expression being in any sense universal and capable of being shared. The genius must also find a mode of expression which allows a viewer not just to 'understand' the work conceptually, but to reach something like the same excited yet harmonious state of mind that the genius had in creating

Starting in sect.43, Kant addresses himself particularly to fine art for the first time. The notion of aesthetic judgment already developed remains central. But unlike the investigation of beauty in nature, the focus shifts from the transcendental conditions for judgment of the beautiful object to the transcendental conditions of the making of fine art. In other words: how is it possible to make art? To solve this, Kant will introduce the notion of genius.

But that is not the only shift. Kant stands right in the middle of a complete historical change in the central focus of aesthetics. While formerly, philosophical aesthetics was largely content to take its primary examples of beauty and sublimity from nature, after Kant the focus is placed squarely on works of art. Now, in Kant, fine art seems to 'borrow' its beauty or sublimity from nature. Fine art is therefore a secondary concept. On the other hand, of course, in being judged aesthetically, nature is seen 'as if' purposeful, designed, or a product of an intelligence. So, in this case at least, the notion of 'nature' itself can be seen as secondary with respect to the notions of design or production, borrowed directly from art. Thus, the relation between nature and art is much more complex than it seems at first. Kant's work thus forms an important part of the historical change mentioned above. Moreover, it is clear from a number of comments that Kant makes about 'genius' that he is an aesthetic conservative reacting against, for example, the emphasis on the individual, impassioned artist characteristic of the 'Sturm und Drang' movement. But, historically, his discussion of the concept contributed to the escalation of the concept in the early 19th Century.

So, in order to understand how art is possible, we have to first understand what art is, and what art production is, vis-á-vis natural objects and natural 'production'. First, then, what does Kant mean by 'nature'? (1) On the one hand, in expressions like 'the nature of X' (e.g. 'the nature of human cognition'), it means those properties which belong essentially to X. This can either be an empirical claim or, more commonly in Kant, a priori. On the other hand, nature as itself an object has several meanings for Kant. Especially: (2) If I say 'nature as opposed to art' I mean that realm of objects not presented as the objects of sensible will - that is, which are quite simply not made or influenced by human hands. (3) If I say 'nature as an object of cognition' I mean any object capable of being dealt with 'objectively' or 'scientifically'. This includes things in space outside of us, but also aspects of sensible human nature that are the objects of sciences such as psychology. (4) Nature is also the object of reflective judgments and is that which is presupposed to be purposive or pre-adapted with respect to judgment.

Kant begins by giving a long clarification of art. As a general term, again, art refers to the activity of making according to a preceding notion. If I make a chair, I must know, in advance, what a chair is. We distinguish art from nature because (though we may judge nature purposive) we know in fact there is no prior notion behind the activity of a flower opening. The flower doesn't have an idea of opening prior to opening - the flower doesn't have a mind or a will to have or execute ideas with.

Art also means something different from science - as Kant says, it is a skill distinguished from a type of knowledge. Art involves some kind of practical ability, irreducible to determinate concepts, which is distinct from a mere comprehension of something. The latter can be fully taught; the former, although subject to training to be sure, relies upon native talent. (Thus, Kant will later claim, there can be no such thing as a scientific genius, because a scientific mind can never be radically original. See sect.46.) Further, art is distinguished from labor or craft - the latter being something satisfying only for the payoff which results and not for the mere activity of making itself. Art (not surprisingly, like beauty) is free from any interest in the existence of the product itself.

Arts are subdivided into mechanical and aesthetic. The former are those which, although not handicrafts, never-the-less are controlled by some definite concept of a purpose to be produced. The latter are those wherein the immediate object is merely pleasure itself. Finally, Kant distinguishes between agreeable and fine art. The former produces pleasure through sensation alone, the latter through various types of cognitions

This taxonomy of fine art defines more precisely the issue for Kant. What, then, 'goes on' in the mind of the artist? It is clearly not just a matter of applying good taste, otherwise all art critics would be artists, all musicians composers, and so forth. Equally, it is not a question of simply expressing oneself using whatever means come to hand, since such productions might well lack taste. We feel reasonably secure that we know how it is possible for, for example, clockmakers to make clocks, or glass-blowers to blow glass (which doesn't mean that we can make clocks or blow glass, but that as a kind of activity, we understand it). We have also investigated how it is for someone looking at a work of beauty to judge it. But it is not yet clear how, on the side of production, fine art gets made.

Kant sums up the problem in two apparent paradoxes. The first of these is easy to state. Fine art is a type of purposeful production, because it is made; art in general is production according to a concept of an object. But fine art can have no concept adequate to its production, else any judgment on it will fail one of the key features of all aesthetic judgments: namely purposiveness without a purpose. Fine art therefore must both be, and not be, an art in general.

To introduce the second paradox, Kant notices that we have a problem with the overwrought - that which draws attention to itself as precisely an artificial object or event. 'Over-the-top' acting is a good example. Kant expresses this point by saying that, in viewing a work of art we must be aware of it as art, but it must never-the-less appear natural. Where 'natural' here stands for the appearance of freedom from conventional rules of artifice; this concept is derived from the second sense of 'nature' given above. The paradox is that art (the non-natural) must appear to be natural.

Kant must overcome these paradoxes and explain how fine art can be produced at all. In sect.46, the first step is taken when Kant, in initially defining 'genius', conflates 'nature' in the first sense above with nature in the third sense. He writes,

Genius is the talent (natural endowment) that gives the rule to art. Since talent is an innate productive ability of the artist and as such belongs itself to nature, we could also put it this way: Genius is the innate mental predisposition (ingenium) through which nature gives the rule to art. (sect.46)

In other words, that which makes it possible to produce (fine art) is not itself produced - not by the individual genius, nor (we should add) through his or her culture, history, education, etc. From the definition of genius as that talent through which nature gives the rule to art follows (arguably!) the following key propositions. First, fine art is produced by individual humans, but not as contingent individuals. That is, not by human nature in the empirically known sense. Second, fine art as aesthetic (just like nature as aesthetic) can have no definite rules or concepts for producing or judging it. But genius supplies a rule, fully applicable only in the one, concrete instance, precisely by way of the universal structures of the genius' mental abilities (which again, is 'natural' in sense one).

Third, the rule supplied by genius is more a rule governing what to produce, rather than how. Thus, while all fine art is a beautiful 'presentation' of an object (sect.48), this partly obscures the fact that genius is involved in the original creation of the object to be presented. The 'how' is usually heavily informed by training and technique, and is governed by taste. Taste, Kant claims, is an evaluative faculty, not a productive one (sect.48). Thus, the end of sect.47, he will distinguish between supplying 'material' and elaborating the 'form'. Fourth, because of this, originality is a characteristic of genius. This means also that fine art properly is never an imitation of previous art, though it may 'follow' or be 'inspired by' previous art (sect.47). Fifth, as we mentioned above, fine art must have the 'look of nature' (sect.45). This is because the rule of its production (that concept or set of concepts of an object and of the 'how' of its production which allows the genius to actually make some specific something) is radically original. Thus, fine art is 'natural' in sense two, in that it lies outside the cycle of production and re-production within which all other arts in general are caught up (and thus, again, cannot be imitated). This leads Kant to make some suggestive, but never fully worked out, comments about artistic influences and schools, the role of culture, of technique and education, etc. (See e.g. sect.49-50)

Having made the various distinctions between the matter and the form of expression in genius' work, or again between the object and its presentation, Kant applies these to a brief if eccentric comparative study of the varieties of fine art (sect.51-53). According to the manner of presentation, he divides all fine arts into the arts of speech (especially poetry, which Kant ranks the highest of the arts), the arts of visual form (sculpture, architecture and painting), and the arts involving a play of sensible tones (music). The last pages of this part of Kant's book are taken up with a curious collection of comments on the 'gratifying' (non-aesthetic but still relatively free activities), especially humor.

However, we have not yet clarified what kind of thing the 'rule' supplied by genius is; therefore we have not yet reached an understanding of the nature of the 'talent' for the production of fine art that is genius.

Genius provides the matter for fine art, taste provides the form. The beautiful is always formal, as we have already discovered. So, what distinguishes one 'matter' from another, such that genius might be required? What genius does, Kant says, is to provide 'soul' or 'spirit' ('Seele', sect.49) to what would otherwise be uninspired. This peculiar idea seems to be used in a sense analogous to saying that someone 'has soul', meaning to have nobility or a deep and exemplary moral character, as opposed to being shallow or even in a sense animal-like; but Kant also, following the Aristotelian tradition, means that which makes something alive rather than mere material. There can be an uninspired fine art, but it is not very interesting (pure beauty, mentioned above, may be an example). There can also, Kant warns, be inspired nonsense, which is also not very interesting. Genius inspires art works - gives them spirit - and does so by linking the work of art to what Kant will call aesthetic ideas.

This is defined in the third paragraph of sect.49. The aesthetic idea is a presentation of the imagination to which no thought is adequate. This is a 'counterpart' to rational ideas (which we encountered above in talking of the sublime), which are thoughts to which nothing sensible or imagined can be adequate. Each is excessive, we might say, but on different sides of our cognitive apparatus. Aesthetic ideas are seen to be 'straining' after the presentation of rational ideas - this is what gives them their excess over any set of ordinary determinate concepts.

In the judgment of the beautiful, we had a harmony between the imagination and the understanding, such that each furthered the extension of the other. Kant is now saying: certainly that is true for all judgments of taste, whether of natural or artificial objects. And yet we can distinguish between such a harmony which happens on the experiencing of a beautiful form simply, or a harmony which happens on the experiencing of a beautiful form that itself is the expression of something yet higher but that cannot in any other way be expressed. (The notion of 'expression' is important: what Kant is describing is an aesthetic process, rather than a process of understanding something with concepts, and then communicating that understanding.) Inspired fine art is beautiful, but in addition is an expression of the state of mind which is generated by an aesthetic idea.

The relevant passages in sect.49 are both confused and compressed. Kant seems to have two different manners in which aesthetic ideas can be the spirit of fine art. First, the aesthetic idea is a presentation of a rational idea (one of Kant's examples is the moral idea of cosmopolitan benevolence). Of course, we know that there is no such adequate presentation. An obvious example might be a novelist or playwright's attempt to portray a morally upright character: because, for Kant, an important part of our moral being transcends the world of phenomena, there must always be a mis-match between the idea and the portrayal of the character. Here the aesthetic idea seems to function by prompting an associated or coordinated surplus of thought that is directly analogous to the associated surplus of imaginative presentations demanded by rational ideas. (We saw a similar relation between the demand of rational ideas and imaginative activity in Kant's analysis of the sublime. Indeed, arguably there is an analogy here to the concept of 'negative exhibition'.) In practice, this will often involve what Kant calls 'aesthetic attributes': more ordinary, intermediate images: 'Thus Jupiter's eagle with the lightning in its claws is an attribute of the mighty king of heaven'.

Second, the aesthetic idea can be an impossibly perfect or complete presentation of a possible empirical experience and its concept (death, envy, love, fame are Kant's examples). Here the aesthetic idea is not presenting a particular rational idea so much as a general function of reason: the striving for a maximum, a totality or the end of a series (as in Kant's account of the mathematical sublime). And again, the effect is an associated 'expansion' of the concept beyond its determinate bounds. In either case, the aesthetic idea is not merely a presentation, but one which will set the imagination and understanding into a harmony, creating the same kind of self-sustaining and self-contained feeling of pleasure as the beautiful.

Kant's theory of genius - for all its vagueness and lack of philosophical rigor - has been enormously influential. In particular, the radical separation of the aesthetic genius from the scientific mind; the emphasis on the near-miraculous expression (through aesthetic ideas and attributes) of the ineffable, excited state of mind; the link of fine art to a 'metaphysical' content; the requirement of radical originality; the raising of poetry to the head of all arts - all these claims (though not all of them entirely unique to Kant) were commonplaces and wide-spread for well over a century after Kant. Indeed, when modernists protested (often paradoxically) against the concept of the artist by using 'automatic writing' or 'found objects' it is, for the most part, this concept of the artist-genius that they are reacting against.

e. Idealism, Morality and the Supersensible

Overview: Let us return to the notion of beauty as tackled in sections A1 and A2. Viewed from the position of our knowledge of nature, the supposed purposiveness of nature looks like nonsense. Not only does our scientific knowledge seem to have no room for the concept of a purpose, but many and perhaps all beautiful natural objects can be accounted for on purely scientific terms. Thus, any principle of purposiveness can only be understood as ideal. That is, such a principle says more about the particular nature of our cognitive faculties than it says about what nature really is.

But the principle of purposiveness is still valid from the point of view of the activities of judgment. This in turn means that, for judgment, the question is valid as to how this natural purposiveness is to be explained. The only possible account is that the appearance of purposiveness in nature is conditioned by the supersensible realm underlying nature. But this means that beauty is a kind of revelation of the hidden substrate of the world, and that this substrate has a necessary sympathy with our highest human projects. To this, Kant adds a series of important analogies between the activity of aesthetic judgment and the activity of moral judgment. These analyses lead Kant to claim that beauty is the 'symbol of morality'.

Above, at the end of section A1, we saw Kant claim that his whole account of the transcendental possibility of judgments on the beautiful could be summed up in the notion of common sense. This principle of common sense is the form that the general a priori principle of the purposiveness of nature for judgment takes when we are trying to understand the subjective conditions of aesthetic judgments of beauty. That is, where the principle is taken as a rule governing the conditions of aesthetic judgments in the subject, then it is properly called 'common sense'. But where the principle is taken to be functioning like a concept of an object (the beautiful thing), then it is to be seen as the principle of the purposiveness of all nature for our judgment (see sect.55-58). But nature, understood scientifically, is not purposive. This strange situation gives rise to what Kant calls a 'dialectic' - merely apparent knowledge claims or paradoxes that arise from the misuse of a faculty. Just as in the 'dialectic' sections in the first two Critiques (see the entry on 'Kant's Metaphysics'), he Kant solves the problem by way of an appeal to the rational idea of the supersensible. Dialectical problems, for Kant, always involves a confusion between the rational ideas of the supersensible (which have at best a merely regulative validity) and natural concepts (which have a validity guaranteed but restricted to appearances). This particular form of dialectical problem involves two contradictory, but apparently necessary, truth claims – Kant calls such a situation an ‘antinomy’. (See Introduction 2 above, and the entry on ‘Kant’s Metaphysics’.) A similar dialectical problem will arise in the 'Critique of Teleological Judgment' where we will resume our discussion of these issues. For the moment it is enough to observe that the Antinomy of Taste seems to involve two contradictory claims about the origin of beautiful objects.

However, it could be the case that nature as the object of scientific laws ('nature', as Kant is fond of saying, according to the 'immanent' principles of the understanding), is itself responsible for the beautiful forms in nature (Kant's example is the formation of beautiful crystals, understood perfectly through the science of chemistry). This possibility demonstrates the idealism of the principle of purposiveness. Kant thus writes, 'we ... receive nature with favor, [it is] not nature that favors us' (sect.58).

He writes,

Just as we must assume that objects of sense as appearances are ideal if we are to explain how we can determine their forms a priori, so we must presuppose an idealistic interpretation of purposiveness in judging the beautiful in nature and in art... (sect.58)

But at the same time, this idealism also necessarily raises the question of what conditions beautiful appearances: if we are asking for a concept that accounts (on the side of the ideal object) for this purposiveness, it must be what Kant calls the realm of the 'supersensible' that is 'underlying' all nature and all humanity. As we know, no other concept (e.g. a natural concept) is adequate to grasping the beautiful object as beautiful. So, in forming an aesthetic judgment, which judges a beautiful object as purposive without purpose, we must assume the legitimacy of the rational concept of an underlying supersensible realm in order to account for that purposiveness. This assumption is valid only within and only for that judgment, and thus is certainly not a matter of knowledge. Thus, Kant can borrow the notion of aesthetic idea from his account of fine art and, speaking from the point of view of reflective judgment, say that beauty in general is always the expression of aesthetic ideas (sect.51). From the point of view of judgment, everything happens as if the unfolding beauty of the natural world is like the product of a genius. This piques the interest of reason - for judgment has, as it were, found phenomenal evidence of the reality of reason's more far-reaching claims about the supersensible (see B3 below). The profundity of beauty, for Kant, consists of precisely this assumption by judgment; it allows him to make further connections between beauty and morality, and (as we shall see) ultimately to suggest the unity of all the disciplines of philosophy.

The last major section of the Critique of Aesthetic Judgment famously considers the relation between beauty and morality, which recalls the earlier treatment of the sublime and moral culture. Here, Kant claims that beauty is the 'symbol' of morality (sect.59). A symbol, he argues, is to be defined as a kind of presentation of a rational idea in an intuition. The 'presentation' in question is an analogy between how judgment deals with or reflects upon the idea and upon the symbolic intuition. Thus, if 'justice' is symbolized by a blind goddess with a scale, it is not because all judges are blind! Rather, 'blindness' and 'weighing' function as concepts in judgments in a way analogous to how the concept of 'justice' functions. In showing how beauty in general is the symbol of morality, Kant lists four points: (1) Both please directly and not through consequences; (2) Both are disinterested; (3) Both involve the idea of a free conformity to law (free conformity of the imagination in the case of beauty, of the will in the case of morality); (4) Both are understood to be founded upon a universal principle. The importance of this section is two-fold: first, historically, Kant is giving a philosophical underpinning to the notion that taste should be related to and, through cultivation, also promotes morality. This is a claim that is often rolled out even today. Second, the link to morality is a detailing out of the basic link between aesthetics in general and the pure concepts of reason (ideas). First aesthetic judgments (both the sublime and the beautiful), and then teleological judgments will form the bridge between theoretical and practical reason, and (Kant hopes) bring unity to philosophy. We shall return to this in section B4.

3. Kant's Teleology

a. Objective Purposiveness and Science

Overview: The second part of Kant's book deals with a special form of judgment called 'teleological judgment'. The word 'teleology' comes from the Greek word 'telos' meaning end or purpose. A teleological judgment, on Kant’s account, is a judgment concerning an object the possibility of which can only be grasped from the point of view of its purpose. The purpose in question Kant calls an 'intrinsic purpose'. In such a case, we have to say that, strictly speaking, the object was not made according to a purpose that is different from the object (as the idea of vegetable soup in the mind of the cook is different from the soup itself), but that the object itself embodies its purpose. Kant is talking mainly about living organisms (which he calls 'natural purposes'), which are both cause and effect, both blueprint and product, of themselves. The problem here is that such a notion is paradoxical for human thought in general, and certainly incompatible with scientific thought.

This raises two issues. First, the paradoxical nature of any concept of a natural purpose means that our minds necessarily supplement judgment with the concept of causation through purposes - i.e. the concept of art, broadly speaking. In other words, for lack of any more adequate resources, we think natural purposes on an analogy with the production of man-made objects according to their purpose. Second, just as with aesthetic judgments, Kant does not claim that such judgments ever achieve knowledge. Kant argues that teleological judgments are required, even in science - but not to explain organisms, rather simply to recognize their existence, such that biological science can then set about trying to understanding them on its own terms.

The word 'teleology' comes from the Greek word 'telos' meaning end or purpose. A teleological judgment, on Kant’s account, is a judgment concerning an object the possibility of which can only be grasped from the point of view of its purpose.

The second half of Kant's book (the 'Critique of Teleological Judgment') is much less often studied and referred to. This is of course related to the fact that Kant's aesthetics has been hugely influential, while his teleology has sparked less contemporary interest; and also the fact that, in the Introduction to the whole text, Kant writes that 'In a critique of judgment, [only] the part that deals with aesthetic judgment belongs to it essentially.' (Introduction VIII). This is because, as we saw above, in aesthetic judgment the faculty of judgment is, as it were, on its own - although certainly the action of judgment there has implications for our faculty of reason. In teleological judgment, on the other hand, the action of judgment - although still reflective - is much more closely linked to ordinary theoretical cognition of nature. Judgment in its teleological function is not, let us say, laid bare in its purity. However, it would be wrong to ignore the 'Critique of Teleological Judgment' either on the grounds of its lesser influence, or especially on the assumption that its content is intrinsically less interesting.

The main difference between aesthetic and teleological judgments is the 'reality' of the purpose for the object. Whereas the object of aesthetic judgment was purposive without a purpose, the objects of teleological judgment do have purposes for which a concept or idea is to hand. There are, Kant claims, two types of real purposes: first, an 'extrinsic purpose’ which is the role a thing may play in being a means to some end. An example would be an object of art in the general sense: a shoe for example, or a landscaped garden - something that was made for a purpose, and where the purpose is the reason behind it being made.

However, just as in the critique of aesthetic judgment, such ordinary examples are not (apparently) troubling and are thus not what Kant has in mind. So, Kant notes that there is a second type of real purpose, an 'intrinsic purpose’. In this case, rather than the purpose being primarily understood as ‘behind’ the production of a thing, a thing embodies its own purpose. These are what Kant calls 'natural purposes' (also translated as 'physical ends'), and the key examples are living organisms (sect.65).

Such an organism is made up of parts - individual organs, and below that, individual cells. These parts, however, are 'organized' - they are determined to be the parts that they are - according to the form or 'purpose' which is the whole creature. The parts reciprocally produce and are produced by the form of the whole. Nor is the idea of the whole separate to the organism and its cause (for then the creature would be an art product.) A mechanical clock may be made up or organized parts, but this organization is not the clock itself, but rather the concept of the clock in the mind of the craftsperson who made it. The organism is such insofar as it intrinsically and continually produces itself; the clock is not an organism because it has to be made according to a concept of it.

But how does this principle relate to the sciences of nature? Such an account of organisms as teleological is not original to Kant. It extends back to Aristotle, and, despite increasing hostility to Aristotle's physics since the Renaissance, remained a commonplace in European biology through the 18th century and beyond. Kant is very careful to distinguish himself from the rationalist position which, he claims, takes teleology as a constitutive principle - that is, as a principle of scientific knowledge. Importantly, Kant claims that such a teleological causation is utterly alien to natural causation as our understanding is able to conceive it. However, since natural mechanical causal connections are necessary, this means that a physical end has to be understood to be contingent with respect to such 'mechanical' natural laws. Reason, however, always demands necessity in its objects (the principle of reason here is akin to Leibniz's notion of the principle of sufficient reason; see entry on Leibniz's Metaphysics). Accordingly, reason provides the idea of causation according to ends (on the analogy of art being the product of a will). As we know, however, a purely rational concept has no constitutive validity with respect to objects of experience. Instead, Kant claims, teleological judgment is merely reflective, and its principle merely regulative. The teleological judgment gives no knowledge, in other words, but simply allows the cognitive faculty to recognize a certain class of empirical objects (living organisms) that then might be subjected (so far as that is possible) to further, empirical, study. In effect, Kant is saying that, were it not for the reflective judgment and the principle of its functioning here (the rational idea of an 'intrinsic' end or purpose), the ability to experience something as alive (and thus subsequently to study it as the science of biology) would be impossible. Ordinary scientific judgments will be unable to fully explore and explain certain biological phenomena, and thus teleological judgments have a limited scientific role.

Such judgments only apply (with the above mentioned constraints) to individual things on the basis of their inner structure, and are not an attempt to account for their existence per se. Nevertheless, even this suggests to reason by analogy the idea of the whole of nature as a purposive system, which could only be explained if based upon some supersensible foundation – although it is hardly necessary in every instance to take the investigation so far (sect.85). In fact, the whole of nature is not given to us in this way, Kant admits, and therefore this extended idea is not as essential to science as the narrower one of natural purposes (sect.75). Nevertheless, the idea may be useful in discovering phenomena and laws in nature that might not have been recognized on a mechanical understanding alone. (Recent ecological thought, for example, has often tended to think of whole eco-systems as if they were in themselves organisms, and whole species of plants and animals (as well as the physical environment they inhabit) are their 'organs'. Such an approach may be fruitful for understanding the inter-connectedness of the system, but also may be dangerous if taken too far - when it begins to see as necessary what in fact has to be considered as contingent.)

Thus Kant believes he has discovered a role, albeit a limited one, for teleological judgments within natural science. In fact, of course, the whole conception of biological science was moving away from such notions, first with the theory of evolution, and subsequently with the idea of genetics. Nevertheless, there is something fascinating about Kant's conception of a natural purpose, which seems to capture something of the continuing scientific and philosophical difficulties in understanding what 'life' in general is.

b. 'The Peculiarity of the Human Understanding'

Overview: Why is it the case that a proper concept of a natural purpose is impossible for us, and has to be supplemented with the concept of production according to a separate purpose? It is because of a fundamental 'peculiarity' of the human understanding, according to Kant. Our minds he describes as 'intellectus ectypus', cognition only by way of 'images'. That is why it is impossible for us to understand something that is at the same time object and purpose. Kant then claims that this characterization of the human intellect raises the possibility of another form of intellect, the 'intellectus archetypus', or cognition directly through the original. In such a case, there would be no distinction between perceiving a thing, understanding a thing, and the thing existing. This is as close as our finite minds can get to understanding the mind of God.

However, in dealing with the limited role discussed above, there is an implicit danger. If reason does not pay sufficient critical attention to the reflection involved the result is an antinomy (sect.70) between the basic scientific principle of the understanding - to seek to treat everything as necessary in being subject to natural laws - and the teleological principle - that there are some objects that are cannot be treated according to these laws, and are thus radically contingent with respect to them. Kant's basic solution to this antinomy is given immediately (sect.71): the problem is simply that reason has forgotten that the second of these principles is not constitutive of its object – that is, does not account of the object’s existence. There could only be an antinomy if both principles were understood to be so constitutive. Kant, however, continues for several sections the discussion of the antinomy and its solution, in the end proposing a remarkable new solution.

In sect.77, Kant is at pains to point out that the teleological, reflective judgment is a necessity for human minds because of a peculiarity of such minds. (This discussion recalls the treatment of idealism in the 'Critique of Aesthetic Judgment' above.) In our understanding of the world (and for any other understanding we could imagine the workings of), the universal principle (law of nature) never fully determines any particular thing in all its real detail. Thus these details, although necessary in themselves as part of the order of nature, must be contingent with respect to our universal concept. It is simply beyond our understanding that there should be a concept that, in itself, determines as necessary all the features of any particular thing. (At this point, Kant is clearly influenced by Leibniz's idea of the 'complete concept' - please see the entry on Leibniz's Metaphysics.) As Kant explains it, an object so understood would be a whole that conditions all its parts.

But a living organism would be just such a whole. As we have seen, to understand its possibility we have to apply (through reflective judgment) the rational idea of an intrinsic purpose. Here, as we have just seen, the problem of the contingency with respect to natural law is exacerbated. But this idea is of a presentation of such a whole, and the presentation is conceived of as a purpose which conditions or leads to the production of the parts. Ours, in other words, is an understanding which always 'requires images (it is an intellectus ectypus)' (sect.77).

This peculiarity of our understanding poses the possibility of another form of intelligence, the intellectus archetypus, an intelligence which is not limited to this detour of presentations in its thinking and acting. Such an understanding would not function in a world of appearances, but directly in the world of things-in-themselves. Its power of giving the universal (concepts and ideas) would not be a separate power from its power of forming intuitions of particular things; concept and thing, thought and reality would be one. From the point of view of such an understanding, what we humans must conceive as the contingency of natural purposes with respect to the universal concept, is only an appearance. For the intellectus archetypus, such natural purposes would indeed be necessary, in the same sense as events subject to mechanical natural law. Thus, the notion of an intellectus archetypus - and the corresponding distinction for us between appearances and things-in-themselves - gives Kant a more complete way of solving the above antinomy. Because of the limitation of our understanding, we are incapable of knowing the details of the necessity of all natural processes. The idea of a natural purpose is an essential additional principle which partly corrects for this limitation, but also produces the antinomy. But the contingency introduced by the new principle is (or, rather, may be) only a contingency for us (as intellectus ectypus), and therefore the principle of natural purposes does not contradict the demand of reason for necessity.

Such an idea clearly takes us in the direction of theology - the study of the divine being, and that being's relation to creation. But it is above all important to remember that, at this point, Kant is not claiming that there is, or must be, or that he can prove there to be, such a being. Thus, for example, given Kant's concern with purposiveness and design, one might think he would make a case for the so-called 'argument from design' (the argument to the existence of a creator from the apparently designed quality of creation). But, in fact, Kant believes this to be an extraordinarily weak argument (see for example sect.sect.85, 90 and 'General Comment on Teleology'), though interesting. Kant, however, thinks he has an argument which is related to it, and which (within certain limits) works much better. It is this argument which occupies most of the second half of the 'Critique of Teleological Judgment'.

c. The Final Purpose and Kant's Moral Argument for the Existence of God

Overview: The notion of the intellectus archetypus is clearly heading in the direction of philosophical theology. Kant's book culminates with his most sustained presentation and discussion of his Moral Proof for the Existence of God.

Kant's work already included some very famous critiques of other such proofs. In the Critique of Pure Reason, he provides some of the standard attacks on the cosmological and especially the ontological arguments. And in the Critique of Judgment, he argues that the argument from design, at least as normally stated, is very weak. Kant's own proof, he thinks, avoids the problems typical of other arguments, precisely because it does not conclude by stating that we know the existence of God. This is because Kant is quite happy with the idea that God's existence could never be necessary for theoretical reason. But he then asks whether practical reason - i.e. the moral side of our intellect - has the same limitation.

In Kant's account of practical reason, the moral law is conceived of as duty. Acting from the mere pure and universal form of the moral law is everything, the consequences of action do not enter into the equation (see entry on 'Kant's Metaphysics'). However, Kant claims that the moral law obligates us to consider the final purpose or aim of all moral action. This final purpose of moral action Kant calls the 'highest good' (summum bonum). This means the greatest possible happiness for all moral beings. Importantly, this goal is not the ground of morality - unlike ordinary instances of desire or action, wherein I act precisely because I want to reach the goal. Moral action is grounded in duty - but, subsequently, so to speak, we must be assured that the final purpose is actually possible.

Just as moral action must be possible through freedom, so the summum bonum must be possible through moral action. But the possibility of the summum bonum as the final purpose in nature appears to be questionable. Therefore, if our moral action is to make sense, there must be someone working behind the scenes. This could only be activity of a 'moral author of the world' which would make it at least possible for the summum bonum to be reached. Moral action, therefore, assumes the existence of a God. But that the postulation of God lies 'within' moral action in this way automatically discounts the 'moral proof' from any theoretical validity.

After an extended discussion of the ins and outs of the role of teleological judgments in science, from sect.78 to around sect.82, Kant's discussion begins to shift to a quite different topic. In sect.82 he argues in this way: it might seem, he says, that certain features of nature have as an extrinsic purpose their relations to other features: the nectar for the honey, the river for the irrigation of land near its bank, etc. (Ultimately, again, these might be seen as part of the intention or design of the intelligent cause of creation.) This, Kant says, is a perfectly understandable way of speaking sometimes, and even helps us to cognize certain natural processes, but has no objective foundation in science. There is always another way of looking at things for which what we thought was a purpose is in fact only a means to something else entirely (e.g. the nectar is simply a way of attracting bees for the purposes of pollination).

It is sometimes even claimed (often on a religious basis) that human beings are the real, 'ultimate' purpose of nature, and all other things have, in the end, the benefit and use of humans as an extrinsic end. But 'in the chain of purposes man is never more than a link' (sect.83). Nature per se does not, then, contain or pursue any such purposes, not even for man. But Kant is not quite yet finished with these kinds of problems, and introduces in sect.84 the idea of a 'final purpose'.
Kant defines a 'final purpose' as 'a purpose that requires no other purpose as a condition of its possibility' (sect.84). This is no longer an extrinsic purpose that nature might have. Still, it is clear that, again, there can be no intrinsic final purpose in nature -all natural products and events are conditioned, including the world around us, our own bodies and even our mental life. (And living beings, qua natural purposes, are conditioned by themselves.) So, what kind of thing would such a final purpose be? Kant writes, '... the final purpose of an intelligent cause must be of such a kind that in the order of purposes it depends upon no condition other than just the idea of it' (sect.84).

As we have discovered on several previous occasions, for Kant human beings are not merely natural beings. The human capacity for freedom is both a cause which acts according to purposes (the moral law) represented as necessary, and yet which has to be thought as independent of the chain of natural causation/purposes. Kant then writes, carefully, '... if things in the world ... require a supreme cause that acts in terms of purposes, then man [qua free] is the final purpose of creation' (sect.84). (As Kant emphasizes on several occasions - e.g. in the last part of sect.91 - it is the fact of freedom that forms the incontrovertible first premise of the argument he is about to put forward.) Put more grandly, 'without man [as a moral being] all of creation would be a mere wasteland, gratuitous and without a final purpose' (sect.86). Thus, the question that really 'matters', Kant writes, 'is whether we do have a basis, sufficient for reason (whether speculative or practical), for attributing a final purpose to the supreme cause [in its] acting in terms of purposes' (sect.86). Certainly, the argument will not involve a 'speculatively' (i.e. theoretically) sufficient basis.

Kant's 'moral proof for the existence of God' is given beginning in sect.87. Actually, this proof first appeared in the Critique of Practical Reason a few years previously (see entry on Kant's Metaphysics), and is in fact assumed through the Critique of Pure Reason. But Kant's most detailed discussion is in the third Critique.

The rational idea of purposiveness, although never constitutive, seems to be relevant everywhere so far: in Kant's account of the possibility of science in his Introduction, in the account of beauty (and in a different way in the sublime), and in the treatment of teleological judgments. Because these are one and all reflective judgments, they entail neither a theoretical nor a practical conclusion as to what might be behind these purposes. Even where teleological judgments about purposes in nature leads us to consider the possibility of a world author, this approach leaves quite indeterminate (and thus useless for the purposes of religion or theology) our idea of that world author (thus Kant's ultimate criticism of what he calls 'physicotheology' in sect.85). But, Kant asks, is there any reason requiring us to assume nature is purposive with respect to practical reason?

In Kant's account of practical reason, the moral law is conceived of as duty. Acting from the mere pure and universal form of the moral law is everything, the consequences of action do not enter into the equation. However, as Kant makes clear in the Introduction to the Critique of Judgment, the practical faculties in general have to do with desire - i.e. purposes motivating action - and the free will is termed the 'higher' faculty of desire. Kant claims that the moral law necessarily obligates us to consider the final purpose of moral action. However, it is not to be considered as the ground of morality, as would normally be the case in desire, when the presentation of the result (my aim) causes the action (action leading to that aim). This final purpose linked to the higher, moral, faculty of desire Kant calls the 'highest good' (summum bonum). Conceived of as a state of natural beings, this means the greatest possible happiness for all moral beings.

Kant is using this inter-implication of moral law and final purpose of moral action as a premise of his argument. The obvious question that arises is why, given the stress Kant always makes on the absolutely unconditioned nature of moral freedom, he should feel able to make this claim. It would seem as if precisely the purity of the free will would make any connection to purposes immoral. Kant writes that, even speaking practically, we must consider ourselves

... as beings of the world and hence as beings connected with other things in the world; and those same moral laws enjoin us to direct our judging to those other things [regarded] either as purposes or as objects for which we ourselves are the final purpose (sect.87).

In other words, practical reason is a human faculty - where, as always for Kant, being human is defined in terms of a unity of a lower, sensible nature together with a higher, supersensible dimension. Our sensibly conditioned will is not a different thing from our free will, but is the same faculty considered now as phenomenal psychology, now as noumenal activity. This must be the case if our actions in the phenomenal world are to be considered moral in any sense of the word. But this sensibly conditioned will does require attention to be paid to consequences – to the object of our action. Free will may determine itself unconditionally through the mere form of the moral law, but it remains the faculty of will, that is the higher faculty of desire, and thus retains the essential link to purposes.

Just as moral action must be possible through freedom, so the summum bonum must be possible through moral action. The impossibility of achieving this end would make a nonsense of moral action, because it would in effect mean that free will was no longer will, that practical reason was no longer practical (because it could not be said to act). Kant is claiming that it is just part of the meaning of an action - even a purely and formally determined action, i.e. one not conditioned by its purpose - to also posit the possibility of achieving its purpose.

But the possibility of the summum bonum as the final purpose in nature is not at all obvious. Indeed, a cynic might claim that moral action makes no difference at all - that the good man is no more happy for it, and that 'nice guys finish last'. Kant writes,

.. the concept of the practical necessity of [achieving] such a purpose by applying our forces does not harmonize with the theoretical concept of the physical possibility its being achieved, if the causality of nature is the only causality (of a means [for achieving it]) that we connect with our freedom. (sect.87)

The obvious inference then is that the 'causality of nature' cannot be the 'only causality' - and there must also be the moral causality of a moral author of the world which would make it at least possible for the summum bonum to be reached. Without the postulate of such a moral author - who, as we saw above, must have our free morality in mind as a final purpose, if anything - our free moral action could not be represented as possible. Moral action, precisely as both moral and as action, within itself assumes the existence of a God. Of course, in acting morally we may not be conscious either of the summum bonum as final purpose, nor of the necessary postulation of God as moral author of the world - we are just doing what is right. Nevertheless, when that duty is fully understood, these necessary implications will be found within it.

But that the postulation of God is 'within' moral action in this way automatically discounts the 'moral proof' from any theoretical validity. Theoretical philosophy must continue to operate within its legitimate grounds, treating so far as possible all of nature as intelligible in terms of mechanical cause and effect and requiring neither purpose nor creator. This distinction is extremely important for Kant, as despite the link to morality and the 'fact' of our freedom, the 'moral proof' does not make of religion anything but a matter of faith (e.g. sect.91). This involves noting that the conception of God involved in the moral proof is and must be bound up with how things are cognizable by us. (This of course continues the treatment of the intellectus ectypus begun in sect.77 and of the idealism of reflective judgment in sect.58.) Kant writes, As for objects that we have to think a priori (either as consequences or as grounds) in reference to our practical use of reason in conformity with duty, but that are transcendent for the theoretical use of reason: they are mere matters of faith. [...] To have faith ... is to have confidence that we shall reach an aim that we have a duty to further, without our having insight into whether achieving it is possible. (sect.91)

The summum bonum, God as moral author (and the immortality of the soul, treated in the Critique of Practical Reason) are all such objects of faith. For Kant, this stress on faith keeps religion pure of the misunderstandings involved in, for example, fanaticism, demonology or idolatry (sect.89). Kant spends the last fifth of the 'Critique of Teleological Judgment' dealing with how his proof is to be understood, the nature and limitations of its validity, and various metaphysical and religious implications, including those for his own conception of critical philosophy.

Kant's argument and later variations are generally considered to be one of the great arguments for the existence of a God. Obviously, questions can be raised about its validity. For example, whether the possibility of the final purpose is somehow necessarily linked to any moral action. However, the typical objection - that the argument is insufficient to give any knowledge - is just irrelevant, since Kant is not interested in knowledge at this point.

4. The Problem of the Unity of Philosophy and its Supersensible Objects

Overview: Let us conclude by looking at Kant's grand conception for his Critique of Judgment.

The problem of the unity of philosophy is the problem of how thought oriented towards knowledge (theoretical reason) can be a product of the same faculty as thought oriented towards moral duty (practical reason). The problem of the unity of the objects of philosophy is the problem of how the ground of that which we know (the supersensible ground of nature) is the same as the ground of moral action (the supersensible ground of that nature in which the summum bonum is possible - together with freedom within the subject). Kant only makes some rather vague suggestions about how proof of these unities is to be established - but it is clear that he believes the faculty of judgment is the key

We will briefly look at the second of these problems. The central move is the a priori principle of nature's purposiveness for judgment. This amounts to the assumption that judgment will always be possible, even in cases like aesthetic judgment where no concept can be found. As we discussed in A5, this principle makes a claim (though only from the 'point of view' of judgment) about the supersensible ground of nature. This claim leads to two assertions. First, that the supersensible ground of beauty in nature is the same as the undetermined ground of nature as an object of science. Second, it is also capable of moral determination and thus also the same as the supersensible ground of moral nature. Together, these two prove the unity of the supersensible objects of philosophy.

Let us very briefly look at the grand problem Kant poses for himself in the Critique of Judgment. The problem comes down to the implications of the ‘abyss’ that Kant opened up between theoretical and practical philosophy; or, as we may as well put it, between the side of our being that knows or tries to know the world, and the side that wills (or fails to will) according to moral law. Although this issue dominates Kant’s two introductions to his book, the book itself contains only occasional references to it, and certainly no clear statement of a solution. But arguably there is sufficient material to suggest what Kant’s solution might have been.

The following quotation contains the kernel." The understanding, inasmuch as it can give laws to nature a priori, proves that we cognize nature only as appearance, and hence at the same time points to a supersensible substrate of nature; but it leaves this substrate entirely undetermined" (Introduction IX, translation modified). Kant is referring to the first Critique and especially to his solution to the Antinomies therein. The solution there merely required that we recognize the distinction between appearances and things-in-themselves. But this solution required nothing further of the latter other than its mere negative definition: that it not be subject to the conditions of appearance.

Kant continues, ‘Judgment, through its a priori principle of judging nature [purposively; in other words judging nature] in terms of possible particular laws of nature, provides nature’s supersensible substrate (within as well as outside us) with determinability by the intellectual faculty [i.e. reason].’ He is referring here particularly to the principle of reflective judgment (and especially aesthetic judgments on the beautiful) that nature will exhibit a purposiveness with respect to our faculty of judgment, that 'particular' laws of nature will always be 'possible'. This purposiveness can only be accounted for if judgment assumes a supersensible that determines this purposiveness. This supersensible is the ‘same’ supersensible substrate underlying nature as the object of theoretical reason. It is no longer merely indeterminate. But because the particular laws are as yet only 'possible' - and this is exacerbated in aesthetic judgment with the notion of purposiveness ‘without purpose’ - the substrate remains left open, it is ‘determinable’ but not ‘determined’. That is to say, judgment conceives of the supersensible as capable of receiving a determinate purpose, should there be good reasons for assuming there to be such a purpose.

Kant continues, ‘But reason, through its a priori practical law, gives this same substrate determination.’ The determination in question is the one Kant introduced in the moral proof for the existence of God: that is, from the point of view of our moral selves, the ‘same’ supersensible is the ground of phenomenal nature’s co-operation in our moral projects. It carries the summum bonum as its final purpose.

Kant accordingly concludes: ‘Thus judgment makes the transition from the domain of the concept of nature to that of the concept of freedom.’ Judgment has also made the transition such that the supersensible objects of reason have to been seen as ‘the same’. Moreover, Judgment has, on the side of the subjective mind, made it conceivable to reason that its theoretical and practical employments are not only compatible (that was proved already in the Antinomy concerning freedom) but also capable of co-ordination towards moral purposes. Because, on the one hand, aesthetic judgment were found to be not fundamentally different from ordinary theoretical cognition of nature (see A2 above), and on the other hand, aesthetic judgment has a deep similarity to moral judgment (A5). Thus, Kant has demonstrated that the physical and moral universes - and the philosophies and forms of thought that present them - are not only compatible, but unified.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Works by Kant

The standard edition of the collected works in German is Kant's gesammelte Schriften, Edited by the Deutsche Akademie der Wissenshaften, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter. Equally widely available is the Werkausgabe in zwölf Bänden, edited by Wilhelm Weischedel, Frankfurt am Mein: Suhrkamp. There are alternative, perfectly acceptable, translations of most of the following. Cambridge University Press, at the time of writing, is about half-way through publishing the complete works in English.

  • Aesthetics and Teleology. Ed., Eric Matthews and Eva Schaper. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, forthcoming)
  • Critique of Judgment. Trans., Werner Pluhar. (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1987)
  • Critique of Judgment. Trans., James Creed Meredith. (Oxford: Clarendon, 1988)
  • Critique of Practical Reason. Trans., Ed., Lewis White Beck. (Oxford: Maxwell Macmillan International, 1993)
  • Critique of Pure Reason. Trans., Werner Pluhar. (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1996)

b. Other Primary and Secondary Works

For a treatment of various themes in Kant, please also see the introductions to the above editions.

  • Burnham, Douglas. An Introduction to Kant's Critique of Judgment. (Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press [in the US, Columbia University Press], 2000)
  • Caygill, Howard. The Art of Judgement.(Oxford: Blackwell, 1989)
  • Cohen, Ted and Guyer, Paul. Essays in Kant's Aesthetics. (Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1982)
  • Crawford, Donald. Kant's Aesthetic Theory. (Madison: Wisconsin University Press, 1974)
  • Crawford, Paul. The Kantian Sublime. (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1991)
  • Gibbons, Sarah L. Kant's Theory of Imagination.(Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1994)
  • Guyer, Paul, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Kant.(Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992)
  • Guyer, Paul. Kant and the Claims of Taste. (Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press, 1979)
  • Guyer, Paul. Kant and the Experience of Freedom.(Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996)
  • Henrich, Dieter. Aesthetic Judgment and the Moral Image of the World. (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1992)
  • Kemal, Salim. Kant and Fine Art. (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1986)
  • Kemal, Salim. Kant's Aesthetic Theory. (London: St Martin's Press, 1992)
  • Makkreel, Rudi. Imagination and Understanding in Kant. (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1994)
  • McCloskey, Mary. Kant's Aesthetic. (London: Macmillan, 1987) Schaper, Eva. Studies in Kant's Aesthetics.(Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1979)
  • Zammito, John H. The Genesis of Kant's Critique of Judgement.(Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1992)

Author Information

Douglas Burnham
Staffordshire University
United Kingdom