Category Archives: Bioethics

Ethics and Care-Worker Migration

Cited as one of the most pressing issues of our times, health care worker migration is now occurring at unprecedented rates. In the post-colonial era, as many developing countries began to develop and expand their health services and to educate their citizens to staff them, more educated workers left for wealthier countries, often those of the colonists or ones that shared the colonists’ language and other cultural ties.

Health worker migration has seen more than one phase, and taken on many forms. The transnational flow, however—especially from low and middle-income countries to wealthier ones—has never been higher. Of particular concern is asymmetrical migration – the main focus of this article – because it is skewing the distribution of the global health workforce and contributing to severe shortages in some parts of the world. There are also concerns about health worker distribution between urban and rural areas, between the public and private health care sectors, and among fields of specialization, but these will not be discussed here. Because many so-called “source countries” have higher burdens of disease and suffer from lower health care worker-to-population ratios than do destination countries, asymmetrical migration is deepening health inequities and creating what many have described as a global crisis in health.

This article begins by identifying a range of factors that contribute to the movement of health care workers around the globe, specifically from low and middle-income countries to affluent ones.  From there it explores ethical issues that arise concerning the deepening of global health inequalities; the status and treatment of migrant health workers, the implications for their families and communities; and the structure of human health resource planning. There is further consideration of the range of agents who might be said to have responsibilities to address these concerns, and what could be said to ground them. Noted are key efforts made to date as well as ideas for further reform.

Although this article refers to both migrants and emigrants, it is primarily emigrants – those who leave one country and take up residence in another – who are the main concern here. Additionally, the focus will be on nurses and care workers, such as nurse aides and home care aides. These health care workers tend to receive less attention than physicians, yet comprise a substantial share of migrant health care labor, in large part to meet the growing demands and expectations for affordable, quality long-term care services in high income countries. Moreover, the loss of nurses and other care workers is especially troubling for they tend to be the backbone of primary care in developing countries. This focus also highlights important issues concerning gender equity.

Table of Contents

  1. Care Workers on the Move: Contributing Factors
    1. Global Economic Policy
    2. Colonial Legacies
    3. Immigration Policies
    4. Health Care Policies
    5. The “Choices” of Privileged Families
    6. Care Regimes
  2. Ethical Issues
    1. Health Inequities in Source Countries
    2. Autonomy and Equity for Migrant Care Workers
    3. Social Reproduction and Political Capacity
  3. Responsibilities
    1. Responsibilities of Destination Countries
    2. Responsibilities of Other Agents
  4. Remedies
    1. Political and Institutional Strategies
    2. Compensation for Source Countries
    3. Retention Efforts in Source Countries
    4. Economic Policy Reform
    5. Health Policy Planning for the Long-term and Shared Governance for Health
    6. Practices of “Privileged Responsibility”
      1. Preventive Foresight
      2. Recognition
      3. Solidarity
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Care Workers on the Move: Contributing Factors

a. Global Economic Policy

Neo-liberal economic policies may be the greatest contributor to the contemporary movement of health care workers from low and middle to high-income countries. International financial institutions, chiefly the World Bank and International Monetary Fund (IMF), have aimed at making these countries more competitive players in the global marketplace. Their main tools, structural adjustment policies, have in many places led to reductions in health sector (and other) employment. Many people have thus been motivated to seek work in richer nations. Some countries, such as the Philippines and India, have also taken to recruiting and training their own citizens specifically for care work overseas (Yeates 2009). Intent on gaining a share of their remittances, this strategy has become an integral part of their economic development plans.

When asked why they migrate, Philippine-trained nurses, the largest group working abroad, give responses that reflect these background conditions (ILO 2006; Lorenzo, Galvez-Tan, Icamina et al., et al. 2007; Alonso-Garbayo and Maben 2009). They point to high and growing rates of unemployment and feelings of being “underutilized”, even when employed, because their skills often surpass what they can do for patients given the scarcity of available resources. At the same time, many are “overutilized” where staffing is short. These emigrant nurses identify desires for lower nurse to patient ratios, better working hours, higher salaries, and better opportunities for professional development and their families’ well-being. Some also describe familial pressure: given economic conditions and policies at home, working abroad has come increasingly to be seen as an expected strategy for family survival, even a woman’s duty (Kelly and D’Addario 2008; Nowak 2009). Certain forms of nationalist rhetoric, which I discuss below, may contribute to the pressures brought to bear.

b. Colonial Legacies

Even though the current rates of migration are unprecedented, in no small part due to global economic policy, nurses and other health care workers in many major source countries have long been primed for emigration. Missionary and military involvement in the Philippines, along with targeted foreign policy strategies, began fueling the mobility of Filipino nurses over a century ago (Choy 2003). As part of a broad effort to serve American colonists and military personnel stationed there with “modern” medicine, the Baptist Foreign Mission Society established the first nursing school in the country – the Iloilo Mission Hospital School of Nursing – in 1906. Many nurses were sent to the US for additional training, sponsored by groups like Rockefeller, Daughters of the American Revolution, and the Catholic Scholarship Fund. By the 1920s, efforts were well underway to export “American professionalism, standardization, and efficiency” in nursing education and practice – lauded as “rational, scientific, and universalistic” – to the Philippines (Brush 1995, 552). Later, in the wake of World War II, in collaboration with the International Council of Nurses, Rockefeller introduced the Exchange Visitor Program to offer experience in American hospitals for nurses trained abroad, including those from the Philippines. By the mid-1960s, most were moving to jobs in US hospitals.

Since these early days, the numbers leaving have grown exponentially (Cheng 2009). The contemporary surge can be traced to the export-oriented, debt-servicing development strategy established by President Ferdinand Marcos. By the late 1990s, a complex, labor-exporting bureaucracy had emerged. Cultivating this care labor and its export have been government-supported educational institutions that educate and train nurses, chiefly for foreign markets in Saudi Arabia, the US, and the UK. With major capital at stake, some governments have been “only too eager to provide this habitat [my emphasis]” for producing care workers, deemed most valuable as export (Tolentino 1996, 53).

As the example of the Philippines demonstrates, colonial histories figure prominently in the contemporary emigration of care workers. These longstanding “interdependent relationships…established over centuries” (Raghuram 2009, 30) contribute to the global flow of health care workers. In addition to those from the Philippines, Indian nurses now constitute one of the largest groups of emigrant health care workers (Kingma 2006; Khadria 2007; Hawkes, Kolenko, Shockness et al. 2009). Their modern-day migration can trace its roots back to the British Empire’s Colonial Nursing Association (Rafferty 2005).

c. Immigration Policies

Immigration policies also figure into the flow of health care labor across borders to the extent that selective immigration, especially for skilled workers in areas with shortages, is a strategy increasingly used as an instrument of industrial policy under globalization (Ahmad 2005). Health and long-term care industry organizations in high income countries, who regard international recruitment as a way to address shortages and reduce hiring costs and improve retention, indeed, often lobby to ease immigration requirements in order to gain access to nurses and other care workers (Buchan, Parkin, and Sochalski 2003; Pittman, Folsam, Bass, et al. 2007).

In this context, a for-profit international recruitment industry, involved in a range of activities related to recruitment, testing, credentialing, and immigration has emerged and flourished (Connell and Stillwell 2006; Pittman, Folsam, Bass, et al. 2007). Not only has the size of the industry surged, but so too has the number of countries in which recruiters operate. Many of these countries have high burdens of disease and low nurse-to-population ratios.

d. Health Care Policies

The health care policies and planning failures of governments and other agents operating in the health care arena, especially around cost-containment, also play a role (Pond and McPake 2006). The unprecedented vacancies and turnover rates, and growing trend toward early retirement that characterize nursing and direct care work in the US, for example, are attributable to underinvestment, staffing that is insufficient to support quality patient care, increasing hours, between units, centralized decision-making, inadequate opportunity for continuing education and professional development, poor compensation and benefits, and a pervasive sense of disrespect (Aiken, Clarke, Sloan et al. 2002; Berliner and Ginzberg 2002; Allan and Larsen 2003; Institute of Medicine 2003). The worldwide burgeoning need for long-term care, a sector with especially persistent shortages and poor working conditions, alongside what critics cite as the longstanding absence of coherent long-term care policy, is, for example, a major driver of care worker migration. A recent report argues that the unprecedented reliance on migrant care workers around the world is a symptom of inadequate long-term care policy (International Organization for Migration 2010, 7).

e. The “Choices” of Privileged Families

Middle class and more privileged families also arguably contribute, albeit unwittingly, to the emigration of care workers from less well-off parts of the world. As Joan Tronto (2006) suggests, the tendency to understand caring in private terms, that is, as a matter involving the needs of their loved ones exclusively, has implications for the use of human health resources. Home care provided by emigrant women, for example, is on the rise in many places for those who can afford private help. Seen by the privileged as “[c]heap and flexible, this model is [embraced] to overcome the structural deficiencies of public family care provision [and often, crucially, workplace policies regarding family leave] and strikes a good balance between the conflicting needs of publicly supporting care of the elderly and controlling public expenditure” in privileged parts of the world (Bettio, Simonazzi, and Villa 2006). Trying to do the best they can for their families, often under constraints, families in privileged countries may not consider the implications for those less well off in other parts of the world.

f. Care Regimes

Finally, countries’ “care regimes” can contribute to the flow of migrant workers.  How governments structure provisions for the care of children, the ill and the elderly, including support for family caregivers has implications for the demand of migrant workers.  In countries with strong welfare states and provisions for care of the dependent, there appears to be less demand than in countries with weak welfare states.  What’s more, even in strong welfare states, the structure of the support seems to matter: where support for the dependent and their caregivers is professionalized, or formalized, there is more demand for migrant workers than where schemes are more informal (Michel 2010).

2. Ethical Issues

a. Health Inequities in Source Countries

The hope of many government officials and other policy makers has been that remittances sent back to source countries by those working abroad will stimulate economic growth and development through investment and business opportunities, increase trade and knowledge transfer, and over time, reduce poverty. While remittances channel billions of dollars in money and other goods, there is little agreement on the overall impact of migration on countries that export workers (Page and Plaza 2006; Connell 2010). Most studies do not separate out health care workers specifically. Those that do make distinctions among work type have found variation by particular profession, gender, and family circumstance. Evidence suggests that remittances primarily benefit households, often through poverty reduction. In some cases, migrants remit to invest in community programs and groups, or perhaps businesses. Remittances have also been credited for gains in educational attainment, production increases in sectors like agriculture and manufacturing, and entrepreneurial activity.

Still, there is an overwhelming consensus that when health workers leave, population health erodes. Recent evidence suggests that the adverse effects of losing health workers are not likely compensated by remittances, for they do not contribute to the development of health systems, care provision, or compensate for economic losses of educated workers (Ball 1996; Brown and Connell 2006; OECD 2008; Packer, Runnels and Labonté 2010). Low income countries’ investment in education and training for health care workers who ultimately leave for other shores, say some critics, reflect a “perverse subsidy” (Mackintosh, Mensah, Henry et al. 2006).

Fifty-seven countries face severe health worker shortages (WHO 2006).  These shortages affect both the quantity and the quality of health services available and provided. They worsen inequalities in infant, child and maternal health, vaccine coverage, response capacity for outbreaks and conflict, and mental health care. They lead to striking patient-health care worker ratios (especially in rural and remote areas), hospital, clinic, and program closures, and an increased workload for residing health care workers. Shortages in health personnel are said to be the most critical constraint in achieving the U.N. Millennium Development Goals and the WHO/UNAIDS 3 by 5 Initiative (Chen, Evans, Anand, et al. 2004; Médecins sans Frontières 2007). There is, of course, wide variation among countries when it comes to the impact of health care worker migration, depending upon such factors as size of the country, its geography and demographic make-up, disease burden, stock of trained workers, and so on. People in source countries, however, may get less care than they once did, and it may be given by someone with less education and training than would be the case but for migrations. In addition, people who formerly received care may get none at all. In some source countries, the absence of health care workers has caused a “virtual collapse” of health services (Packer, Labonté, and Runnels, 2009, 214). The gap created is often filled within families, as some governments facing under-resourced health care systems cope by “downloading” the work of caring onto women in individual households (Akintola 2004; Wegelin-Schuringa 2006; Harper, Aboderin, and Ruchieva 2008; Makina 2009). The problem is so grave that the Joint Learning Initiative (2004) concluded that the fate of global health and development in the 21st century lies in ensuring the equitable management of human health resources.

There are many ways of capturing what is at stake ethically for the people in source countries whose health care systems are failing. We might say they are harmed because resources are inequitably distributed (Wibulpolprasert and Pengaibon 2003; Dussault and Franceschini 2006), because the equal moral worth of particular groups of people, and in turn, equal opportunity, is denied (Daniels 2008). We might say, as well, that their welfare interests are threatened. Another view would suggest that global health inequities are morally troubling because deprivations in individuals’ capabilities to function threaten their well-being (Ruger 2006). Following Aristotle’s conception of human flourishing and its contemporary formulation in the “capability approach” of Sen and Nussbaum (Sen 1993), well-being on Ruger’s account is defined as having capabilities to achieve a range of beings and doings, or the freedom to be what we want to be and to do what we want to do.

Although the capabilities approach has not specifically been brought to bear on the problem of health worker migration, other rights-based arguments have played a prominent role. A number of commentators launch critiques of the depletion of source countries’ human health resources based on a human right to health (Gostin 2008; Shah 2010; O’Brien and Gostin 2011), a right ensconced in a number of international declarations including the United Nations Charter, the UN Covenant on Economic, Social and Cultural Rights (1966), and the WHO Constitution (1948). The necessity of the health workforce to the health system, and in turn, to realizing this asserted right, is recognized in the WHO’s Code of Practice on the International Recruitment of Health Personnel (2010b).

The harm, finally, might be explained in terms of structural injustice. Structural injustice

exists when social processes [that is, social norms and economic structures, institutional rules, incentive structures, and sanctions, decision-making processes, etc] put large categories of persons under a systematic threat of domination or deprivation of the means to develop and exercise their capacities, at the same time as these processes enable others to dominate or have a wider range of opportunities for developing and exercising their capacities.

The ethical concern is not merely that structures constrain. “Rather the injustice consists in the way they constrain and enable,” serving systematically to expand opportunities for the privileged while contracting them for the less well-off (Young 2006, 114).

From a plurality of ethical perspectives, then, the asymmetrical migration of care workers is deeply problematic.

b. Autonomy and Equity for Migrant Care Workers

The implications—including ethical, social and political, and economic—for migrant care workers are also significant. Here I explore them with an emphasis on autonomy and equity. If we understand autonomy to mean something like being relatively free to choose one’s actions and course in life from a decent set of options, and equity to mean something like the absence of avoidable and unfair inequalities, the picture that emerges is complex and yields no simple conclusions.

Threats to autonomy and equity for migrant care workers come from several sources. Part of the feminization of international migration, women seeking employment in more affluent countries as maids, nannies, nurses, and other care workers, has come to be an especially integral part of the global economy (Ehrenreich and Hochschild 2002; Van Eyck 2005; Kingma 2006; Dumont, Martin, and Spielvogel 2007). Yet, to the extent that the global migration of nurses and other care workers is fueled by “the ideological construction of jobs and tasks in terms of notions of appropriate femininity” and in terms of racial and cultural stereotypes, it raises concerns. The construction of Filipinas for instance as caring, obedient, meticulous workers, “sacrificing heroines” (Schwenken 2008), of Indian women and Caribbean women as naturally warm-hearted and joyful, serves the aims of governments, industry organizations and employers, recruiters, and even family caregivers in the North. Yet it potentially perpetuates stereotypes and constrains the imaginations, opportunities and choices of women and girls.

Emigrants from low and middle-income countries are situated amidst different genres of nationalist rhetoric that support neoliberal economic policies. One form is organized around specific conceptions of national community, compelling labor migrants to organize their conduct around what is beneficial to states’ economies. Indeed, “the brain drain migrant is a particular subjectivity, forged by the needs of late capitalism.” Her subjectivity becomes “constituted as an assemblage of morality and economic rationality,” within which she “acts in socially appropriate ways not because of force or coercion but [allegedly] because [her] choices align with . . . ‘community interests’” (Ilcan, Oliver, and O’Connor 2007, 80). Another variety of nationalist rhetoric emphasizes “the active citizen,” a “reconfigured political identity . . . whose aim is to maximize . . . quality of life . . . by being [an] active agent in the market” (Schild 2007, 181). These rhetorical strategies operate with a caring face, suggesting that labor emigrants, especially women, will enjoy expanded opportunities for choice and prospects for equality. Yet to the extent that they “encourage[e] and cultivat[e] . . . forms of subjectivity that are congruent with capitalism in its latest phase” (199), enforce expectations for individual responsibility for familial well-being and constrain the set of options available, they may thwart autonomy for many emigrants.

Although married women with children who migrate are encouraged, even pressed—by governments, by family members, or by both given conditions at home—to provide from abroad for their families and countries, and are celebrated as “modern heroes”, they are often blamed for such social ills as divorce, poor school performance by children, and teen pregnancy in their home countries (Parreñas 2005). Gender norms, then, persist and are manipulated, further contributing to the erosion of autonomy and equity.

Most if not all migrant laborers, including those engaged in care work, are subject to “flexibilization,” a “process of self-constitution that correlates with, arises, from, and resembles a mode of social organization” (Fraser 2009, 129). Its central features are fluidity, provisionality, and a temporal horizon of no long-term. Transnational economic and other structures compel care workers to mobilize, for example, when most say they would rather work at home. Movement to care labor markets in the North may involve taking jobs below the education and skill level of care workers, a practice known as “down-skilling”. There is also the rapid expansion of the informal or “grey” economy, and the tendency under neo-liberal economic policies to define more and more jobs as temporary and unskilled. Inequities may persist under such schemes and choices may be constrained.

Furthermore, although countries often incentivize immigration for some workers, including some categories of care workers, questions of immigration and citizenship are contested.  Countries “differentially incorporate” migrants when it comes to immigration and citizenship status (Parreñas 2000; Kofman and Raghuram 2006; Carens 2008). Care workers, especially the “unskilled”, often lack citizenship in the countries where they are employed. They therefore have a limited set of political rights and labor protections (Ball and Piper 2002; Ball 2004; Stasiulis and Bakan 2005; Dauvergne 2009; Bosniak 2009). Access to health and social services may also be diminished or lacking altogether (Meghani and Eckenwiler 2009; Deeb-Sosa and Mendez 2008).

More generally, like other migrants who describe feelings of dislocation, some emigrant nurses describe the experience of “having a foot here, a foot there, and a foot nowhere” (DiCicco-Bloom 2004, 28) and lacking a sense of belonging (Van Eyck 2004; Sørenson 2005; Hausner 2011).  In addition to potential political disenfranchisement and exclusion from labor protections, many live in transnational families and engage in transnational care practices, adjusting to “extended family relations and obligations across space and time” (Baldock 2000, 221; Parreñas 2005). To the extent that selves are relational, that is, our identities shaped by familial relationships and engagement in the communities and places from which we come (Mackenzie and Stolijar 2000), migration leads not just to a geographic rupture but a “self-rupture” in many instances (Kittay unpublished). Indeed, these care workers experience a sort of “bi-placement” of identity, enduring the harm of “never feeling oneself as fully here” (Kittay unpublished; Hondagneu-Sotelo 1997).

Moreover, relations with family members and with their social and political communities may be transformed (Parreñas 2000; Espiritu 2005). They may be improved from the perspective of migrant care workers, or they may be eroded or fractured. Indeed, these moral harms faced by individuals can at the same time threaten the relationships themselves; they may lead others to “reinterpret our social or moral standing . . . [and] compromise the…bonds we have with them” (Miller 2009, 513).

Research finds that migrant care workers can reap significant benefits. There can be important gains for women in areas like self-trust and confidence, household decision-making and expenditures, as well as in spatial mobility and freedom from restrictive gender norms (McKay 2004; Pessar 2005; Percot 2006). They may advance their “migration project”, that is, achieve goals they have (albeit under constrained conditions) set for themselves, whether this means contributing to the well-being of their families and themselves at home, or ultimately gaining traction and stability in destination countries. Depending upon a range of factors, many care workers may well be vulnerable, yet become more autonomous and gain greater opportunity.

In sum, to the extent that migrants decisions to migrate come about because their own countries lack the capacities to support them and their families, and even facilitate their departures, and to the extent that they live and work under conditions that do not just alter but distort their identities, threaten their self-respect, relationships, and political engagement, and that perpetuate their status as lower-paid workers with few options in the global economy, their overall prospects for enhanced autonomy and equity are highly unclear (Abraham 2004; Connell and Voigt-Graf 2006; Espiritu 2006; Barber 2009; Nowak 2009).

c. Social Reproduction and Political Capacity

As global capital uses particular places for particular forms of reproduction, and care workers are cultivated, extracted, and exported for the global marketplace – their labor revalued, repackaged, and relocated – not only do health care systems and the ill and dependent suffer, but family and community life, even political capacities, face erosion. Given that the care done within families generates public goods, like citizens, and contributes to their development and duration over the course of life, when a country exports care labor, that is, the women who provide it, it exports capacities for social reproduction (Truong 1996; Parreñas 2000). Most troublingly, to the extent that those with more resources have greater capacities to care—now by importing it—and those who have more resources are further produced and sustained to become more capable citizens, is that the outflow of caregivers may generate profound additional global inequalities in social and political capacity.

3. Responsibilities

Who is responsible for addressing the harms suffered by emigrant care workers, their families and communities, and populations in source countries confronting high disease burdens and worker shortages? The array of agents involved, and therefore candidates for having responsibilities, includes governments in destination as well as source countries, international lending bodies, transnational health care corporations and recruitment agencies, and those who employ emigrant care workers. I begin by considering views on the matter of whether destination countries have obligations to source countries suffering from health inequities, and from there expand to explore what if any responsibilities might be said to exist for these other agents to source countries as well as emigrants.

a. Responsibilities of Destination Countries

A variety of arguments hold that destination countries are not obligated to address health inequities in source countries. One line of thought, which assumes that there is something ethically essential about the nation-state, is that although we might have some obligations to the world’s poor, we have duties to prioritize our compatriots (Miller 2004). Another line of argument holds that we have duties not to interfere in the affairs of other societies (Rawls 1999). A third view emphasizes distance rather than shared state membership; our moral intuitions, according to this account, suggest that our strongest obligations are to those nearby (Kamm 2004). Finally, libertarian theorists suggest that we have no obligations save for situations where we have caused harm, which on their account comes in the form of unfairly acquiring goods or resources (Nozick 1974).

Others, however, maintain that there are at least negative duties and possibly positive ones to address health inequities and other problems generated or worsened by the asymmetrical migration of health care workers. Some argue that our shared human dignity is sufficient to ground responsibilities for global health equity. We have duties, in other words, to prevent suffering when we have the capacity to do so on the basis of our equal moral worth as persons (Singer 1972). Countering the argument that we ought not to interfere in the affairs of other societies, a republican approach holds that freedom should be conceived in terms of non-domination rather than non-interference, and this may generate responsibilities of justice that cross borders (Petit 1997). Luck egalitarian accounts maintain that people should not suffer worse opportunities based on where they come from, so justice demands assistance (Caney 2005).

Arguing from various relational conceptions of justice, some theorists point to the dense relations of interdependence that connect people transnationally to justify principles of justice that transcend the boundaries of states. There are several ways to think about these relations, which are more particular than our shared humanity. According to Onora O’Neill (2000), an agent’s moral obligation encompasses all those people whom his or her activities depend upon, and so, is often global in scope. Thomas Pogge maintains that by “shaping and enforcing the social conditions that foreseeably and avoidably cause the monumental suffering of global poverty, we are harming the global poor …” (2005, 33). According to this view, our relationship is a matter of being “materially involved” in or “substantially contributing to” upholding the institutions responsible for injustice (2004, 137). Iris Marion Young proposes a third relational approach: a “social connection model of responsibility”. Here “[o]bligations of justice arise between [agents] by virtue of the social [often transnational] processes that connect them” (Young 2006, 102). Relational conceptions of justice, thus, implicate not only destination countries, but also the other agents who contribute through their policies and practices to the global, asymmetrical flow of care workers and the inequities this exacerbates. They also highlight the limits of libertarian and non-interventionist accounts.

The complexity of the processes and relations involved in generating injustice presents challenges when it comes to the work of attributing and assigning responsibilities. Given the way that structures and processes operate, responsibility is diffused, or dispersed. It can therefore be difficult if not impossible to identify a particular perpetrator (individual, institutional, or corporate) to whom particular harms might be traced directly. As Young explains, while “structural processes that produce injustice result from the actions of many persons and the policies of many organizations, in most cases it is not possible to trace which specific actions of which specific agents cause which specific parts of the structural processes or their outcomes” (Young 2006, 115). At the same time, adverse effects are not necessarily intended.  Indeed, structural injustice often occurs as a result of our (individual and institutional) choices and actions as we try to advance our own interests “within given institutional rules and accepted norms” (114).

There is one further line of argument that might be brought to bear here. Responsibility can be motivated by prudential arguments, specifically those that acknowledge global interdependence. In other words, motivated by the idea that negative and positive externalities flow over national boundaries that are increasingly porous, the prudential approach justifies state-based action with transnational implications by affirming our interdependence along with the existence of ‘global public goods’. The idea is “to let international cooperation start ‘at home’, with national policies meant, at a minimum, to reduce or avoid altogether negative cross-border spillovers – and preferably to go beyond that to generate positive externalities in the interest of all” (Kaul, Grunberg and Stern 1999). Even, then, if agents are not motivated by moral reasons, prudence may generate responsible action and policy on the part of destination countries for the sake of source countries (Eckenwiler, Chung, and Straehle 2012).

b. Responsibilities of Other Agents

States are certainly not the sole actors on this moral landscape. Typically in discussions of global justice, including discussions of global health equity, states are assumed to have primary responsibility; that is, the “most direct and prior obligations” (Ruger 2006, 1001). Yet, states’ limitations are many. Some states do not have the capability to ensure justice. Others may lack the desire. And some states with the desire to be just are rendered more porous by the activities of other agents—what Onora O’Neill calls “networking institutions” (here, for instance: international lenders, health care corporations and recruiters) operating and exercising power within their borders (O’Neill 2000, 182-185; 2004 246–47). Conceptions of justice, therefore, must reckon with such agents if they are to have any traction under globalization. As noted earlier, relational approaches do, and in turn, assign responsibilities according to such parameters as their scope of power, resources, and degree of contribution to injustice (O’Neill 2000; Young 2006).

As for emigrant and other migrant care workers, the responsibilities of destination countries and those of networking institutions might include reforms in areas such as: recruitment policies and practices; immigration policy; and compensation and working conditions. I discuss these further in the final section.

4. Remedies

An array of interventions and ideas has emerged to try to address at least some of the concerns raised here (Stillwell, Diallo, Zurn et al. 2004; Mensah, Mackintosh and Henry 2005; Packer, Labonté, and Spitzer 2007). They aim variously at responding to health inequities, global health workforce management, and workers’ status and treatment. In the discussion below I focus on efforts underway along with ideas for further reform.

a. Political and Institutional Strategies

Perhaps the most important mechanisms embraced by governments to date are legally binding bilateral or multilateral agreements between source countries or regions and destination countries. These involve agreements for supplies of health professionals from particular countries (specifically those not suffering under low care worker-population ratios and/or high disease burdens) for specified lengths of time to address particular skill shortages. The UK and South Africa, for example, have a bilateral agreement, and some countries within the European Union have multilateral agreements. Recent evidence suggests that state policies can indeed have an impact on health worker migration (Bach 2010). In a related vein, some have called for global resource sharing, including staff sharing programs (Mackey and Liang 2012).

Codes of practice and position statements aimed at protecting the health systems of source countries and ensuring ethical treatment for migrant health workers have also emerged. They emphasize not recruiting from countries with severe shortages and high disease burdens, refraining from unethical recruitment practices, such as deception and misrepresentation, and treating migrant care workers with respect and providing them with labor protections. There are roughly twenty documents developed by governments, including the United Kingdom (UK Department of Health 2004), associations of governments like the Commonwealth Countries (2003) and Pacific Island Countries (Ministers of Health for Pacific Island Countries 2007), along with health professional associations, such as the World Health Organization (2010), the World Federation of Public Health Associations (2005), Academy Health (2008) and the American Public Health Association (Hagopian and Friedman 2006).

While such instruments draw attention to important issues and can raise the level of discourse, a major limit is that they do not address the root causes of migration.  They are also voluntary and their impact is difficult to monitor (Buchan, McPake, Mensah, and Rae 2009). Moreover, the structure and financing of a country’s health system is a significant factor when it comes to their scope. In the UK, for example, which has one major public sector employer and one point of entry for health professionals, a code may have more of an impact than in countries with a wide array of independent private sector health care employers (Buchan, Parkin, and Sochalski 2003; Buchan, McPake, Mensah, and Rae 2009).

b. Compensation for Source Countries

Motivated by compensatory justice, various compensation schemes have been suggested (Agwu and Llewelyn 2009). One model calls for governments of host or destination countries to pay source countries for the investments made in educating health professionals. Alternatively, destination countries could offer funding or other forms of investment for the purpose of capacity building and strengthening health systems in source countries (Mackintosh, Mensah, Henry et al. 2006).

c. Retention Efforts in Source Countries

Perhaps one of the most difficult questions concerns whether health workers have obligations to serve the countries that have provided their education and training (leaving aside countries where export is embedded in economic policy) (Cole 2010; Raustol 2010). Closely tied to this question is the extent to which, if at all, coercion (and what this means precisely) is justified in countries’ policies around health worker migration, particularly retention policies (Eyal and Hurst 2010). Proposals that raise such concerns range from financial and other incentives, where possible, to compulsory service requirements of some specified duration and taxes on migrants (Packer, Labonté, and Spitzer 2007; Masango, Gathu, and Sibandze 2008; Barnighausen and Bloom 2009). Another idea aimed at retaining health care workers is to organize medical school and other health worker curricula in low and middle-income countries around “locally relevant” needs and capacities (Eyal and Hurst 2008). Meanwhile, many source countries are trying to increase training efforts among community and other auxiliary health care workers to fill gaps (Global Health Workforce Alliance 2008).

d. Economic Policy Reform

Global economic policy that shifts to address the constraints that lead to migration faced by care workers in source countries is often the first item on health advocates’ list of reforms. This would mean an end to structural adjustment policies and an investment in health system infrastructure that will staff sufficient numbers and varieties of health care workers, fairly compensate and treat them, and serve the public equitably.

e. Health Policy Planning for the Long-term and Shared Governance for Health

At the country level, specifically in destination countries, long-range planning is clearly essential. When it comes to public health, notes one commentator, “the future is no where in sight” (Graham 2010). Indeed,

[In] spite of its importance, workforce planning and management have traditionally been viewed as low priority by many countries… supply driven with limited attention afforded to population health needs, service demand factors and social, political, geographical, technological and economic factors….[and] carried out in…silos rather than integrated across the various health disciplines/occupations (International Council of Nurses 2006, 10).

Policy makers in such places indisputably have obligations to address these issues for the sake of their own populations. And as has been shown here, many conceptions of justice maintain they also owe it to the poorer nations upon whom they’ve come to rely.

Some might argue for self-sufficiency in human heath resource planning (Mullan, Frehywot and Jolley 2008). This goal seems morally praiseworthy in its quest to avoid unjust relationships between richer and poorer countries. Skepticism as to whether it can be realized given conditions under globalization suggests to many that “shared health governance” ought to become the new model (Ruger 2006, 1001). The precise meaning of this notion is a matter of vitriolic debate; however, in the most general terms it involves governments and global institutions, along with non-governmental organizations, businesses, and foundations, engaged collaboratively in decision-making processes aimed at meeting the specific needs and addressing the constraints particular countries face. Advocates for shared governance over human health resources point to the fact that some form of this is reflected already in a number of areas, including access to essential medicines, vaccines, and tobacco control (O’Brien and Gostin 2011).

f. Practices of “Privileged Responsibility”

The discussion so far has emphasized states and “networking institutions”, and political-legal-institutional reforms. Some contemporary moral and political philosophers, however, would maintain that there is a tendency to underestimate the potential of personal interactions and practices among individuals (Walker 1998; Kurasawa 2007). According to Fuyuki Kurasawa, for example, a “formalist bias” that involves understanding global justice as emerging principally through prescriptive or legislative means, overlooks “the social labour and modes of practice that supply the ethical and political soil within which the norms, institutions and procedures of global justice are rooted” (Kurasawa 2007, 6). He identifies five practices: bearing witness, forgiveness, giving aid, solidarity, and foresight. Such practices may accompany or in some cases facilitate political, legal, economic, and institutional reform.

Here I consider practices that concern the ethical stance people in source countries – especially but not exclusively those who employ them – owe to these emigrants. There are international agreements that call for elements of what I note below, such as the International Convention on the Protection of the Rights of All Migrant Workers and Members of Their Families. I describe three practices, drawing upon Tronto’s concept (2006), of “privileged responsibility”: preventive foresight and solidarity (following Kurasawa), and recognition.

i. Preventive Foresight

Tronto’s argument is that the tendency among middle class and more affluent families to understand caring (particularly for children, the ill, and the dependent) in private terms, that is, as a matter involving the needs of their loved ones exclusively, can lead to moral hazards including social harm. “In a competitive society,” she observes, “what it means to care well for one’s own [family] is to make sure that they have a competitive edge against other [families]” (2006, 10). Ultimately, those acting with what Tronto describes as “privileged irresponsibility” can “ignore the ways in which their own caring activities continue to perpetuate inequality” (13).

To respond to this and other myopias, individuals and families with resources in wealthy countries might practice “preventive forsesight” (Kurasawa 2007) and plan ahead for their own care needs and think critically about their anticipated use of resources. They might ask themselves for example: To what extent do my/our “expectations” or actual needs have implications for others in need of care? Other families? Other communities? Could I/we plan and act in such a way that might avoid or lessen participation in the perpetuation of injustice?

ii. Recognition

Another way of taking seriously the moral status and significance of migrant care workers, their work, and the implications of their mobility might be through the practice of recognition. Recognition has come to be understood in at least two senses: recognition of individuals’ unique identity as an autonomous individual and recognition of persons as belonging to particular communities or groups. It also includes a third dimension, the recognition of others’ needs for relationships, both interpersonal and associative (Gould 2007, 250). Recognizing emigrant care workers in this way might enrich appreciation for the fact that many live in transnational families. Additionally, recognizing interdependence could mitigate against ignorance concerning health inequities in source countries. A fourth dimension might be added: recognition of the conditions – the places – in which care workers provide care, including conditions in the places where their numbers are few, the disease burden is high, and available resources scant.

iii. Solidarity

Solidarity, an increasingly examined concept both in health ethics as well as global justice, may have relevance here. Contemporary thinking on solidarity suggests that it involves reaching beyond the scope of one’s community to cultivate ties with others who have suffered injustice across distance and amid asymmetries, and standing together in advancing justice and resisting injustice (Gould 2007; Lenard 2010). Relations of solidarity might be forged, for example, between governments, employers and employees, people with diminished access to health care, migrant workers, and family caregivers and care workers for moral or prudential reasons (Eckenwiler, Chung, and Straehle 2012).

5. Conclusion

Health worker migration is not the main cause of health inequities; yet, it contributes to them and possibly others. Thus, conditions that facilitate, and the moral agents who participate in facilitating, migration (above all, asymmetrical) call for moral scrutiny. Additionally, the treatment of emigrant care workers warrants ethical investigation. Policies and practices that undermine values such as autonomy and equity should be seen as morally suspect. Finally, the state-level and global management of human health resources demands urgent attention. The present structure characterized by a “perverse subsidy”, ongoing underinvestment in health care (often where it is most needed), even in destination countries, and narrowly nationalist thinking threatens justice for populations everywhere, especially the poor.

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Author Information

Lisa Eckenwiler
George Mason University
U. S. A.


Bioethics is a rather young academic inter-disciplinary field that has emerged rapidly as a particular moral enterprise against the background of the revival of applied ethics in the second half of the twentieth century. The notion of bioethics is commonly understood as a generic term for three main sub-disciplines: medical ethics, animal ethics, and environmental ethics. Each sub-discipline has its own particular area of bioethics, but there is a significant overlap of many issues, ethical approaches, concepts, and moral considerations. This makes it difficult to examine and to easily solve vital moral problems such as abortion, xenotransplantation, cloning, stem cell research, the moral status of animals and the moral status of nature (the environment). In addition, the field of bioethics presupposes at least some basic knowledge of important life sciences, most notably medicine, biology (including genetics), biochemistry, and biophysics in order to deal successfully with particular moral issues. This article also contains a discussion about the vital issue of moral status—and hence protection—in the context of bioethics, that is, whether moral status is ascribed depending on rationality, harm, or any other feature. For example, it might well be the case that non-sentient beings such as plants and unique stone formations, such as the Grand Canyon, do have a moral standing—at least, to some degree—and should not be deliberately destroyed by virtue of either their instrumental or intrinsic value for human beings. The last part contains a discussion of the main bioethical theories including their main line of reasoning and complex challenges in contemporary philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Preliminary Distinctions
  2. A Brief History of Bioethics
    1. The Origin of the Notion of Bioethics
    2. The Origin of the Academic Discipline and Institutionalization of Bioethics
    3. The Origin of Bioethics as a Phenomenon
  3. Sub-disciplines in Bioethics
    1. Introduction
    2. Medical Ethics
    3. Animal Ethics
    4. Environmental Ethics
  4. The Idea of Moral Status in Bioethics
  5. Theory in Bioethics
    1. Introduction
    2. Deontological Approaches
    3. Utilitarianism
    4. The Four-Principle Approach
    5. Virtue Ethics
    6. Casuistry
    7. Feminist Bioethics
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. References
    2. Further Reading

1. Preliminary Distinctions

Rapid developments in the natural sciences and technology (including biotechnology) have greatly facilitated better living conditions and increased the standard of living of people worldwide. On the other hand, there are undesirable consequences, such as nuclear waste, water and air pollution, the clearing of tropical forests, and large-scale livestock farming, as well as particular innovations such as gene technology and cloning, which have caused qualms and even fears concerning the future of humankind. Lacunae in legal systems, for example, regarding abortion and euthanasia, additionally are a cause of grave concern for many people. Furthermore, moral problems which stem from a concrete situation, for example, gene-manipulated food, have given rise to heated public debates and serious public concerns with regard to safety issues in the past. There was---and still is---a need for ethical guidance which is not satisfied simply by applying traditional ethical theories to the complex and novel problems of the twenty-first century.

What are the general goals of bioethics? As a discipline of applied ethics and a particular way of ethical reasoning that substantially depends on the findings of the life sciences, the goals of bioethics are manifold and involve, at least, the following aspects:

  1. Discipline: Bioethics provides a disciplinary framework for the whole array of moral questions and issues surrounding the life sciences concerning human beings, animals, and nature.
  2. Inter-disciplinary Approach: Bioethics is a particular way of ethical reasoning and decision making that: (i) integrates empirical data from relevant natural sciences, most notably medicine in the case of medical ethics, and (ii) considers other disciplines of applied ethics such as research ethics, information ethics, social ethics, feminist ethics, religious ethics, political ethics, and ethics of law in order to solve the case in question.
  3. Ethical Guidance: Bioethics offers ethical guidance in a particular field of human conduct.
  4. Clarification: Bioethics points to many novel complex cases, for example, gene technology, cloning, and human-animal chimeras and facilitates the awareness of the particular problem in public discourse.
  5. Structure: Bioethics elaborates important arguments from a critical examination of judgements and considerations in discussions and debates.
  6. Internal Auditing: The combination of bioethics and new data that stem from the natural sciences may influence−in some cases −the key concepts and approaches of basic ethics by providing convincing evidence for important specifications, for example, the generally accepted concept of personhood might be incomplete, too narrow, or ethically problematic in the context of people with disability and, hence, need to be modified accordingly.

In other words, bioethics is concerned with a specific area of human conduct concerning the animate (for example, human beings and animals) and inanimate (for example, stones) natural world against the background of the life sciences and deals with the various problems that arise from this complex amalgam. Furthermore, bioethics is not only an inter-disciplinary field but also multidisciplinary since bioethicists come from various disciplines, each with its own distinctive set of assumptions. While this facilitates new and valuable perspectives , it also causes problems for a more integrated approach to bioethics.

2. A Brief History of Bioethics

Historically speaking, there are three possible ways at least to address the history of bioethics. First, by the origin of the notion of bioethics, second, by the origin of the academic discipline and the institutionalization of bioethics, and third, by the origin of bioethics as a phenomenon. Each focuses on different aspects concerning the history of bioethics; however, one can only understand and appreciate the whole picture if one takes all three into account.

a. The Origin of the Notion of Bioethics

It is commonly said that the origin of the notion of bioethics is twofold: (i) the publishing of two influential articles; Potter’s “Bioethics, the Science of Survival” (1970), which suggests viewing bioethics as a global movement in order to foster concern for the environment and ethics, and Callahan’s “Bioethics as a Discipline” (1973), in which he argues for the establishment of a new academic discipline, and (ii) discussions between Shriver and Hellegers about the need for an institute in which researchers should examine and analyse medical dilemmas by appealing to moral philosophy (1970). This institute was created in 1971 as the Joseph and Rose Kennedy Center for the Study of Human Reproduction and Bioethics, and is now known as the Kennedy Institute of Ethics (see, also the Institute of Society, Ethics, and the Life Sciences, 1969). However, this  oft-repeated story about the origin of the term bioethics is incorrect. Sass (2007) is right in claiming that the German theologian Fritz Jahr published three articles in 1927, 1928, and 1934 using the German term “Bio-Ethik” (which translates as “Bio-Ethics”) and forcefully argued, both for the establishment of a new academic discipline,  and for the practice of a new, more civilized, ethical approach to issues concerning human beings and the environment. Jahr famously proclaimed his bioethical imperative: “Respect every living being, in principle, as an end in itself and treat it accordingly wherever it is possible,” (1927: 4).

b. The Origin of the Academic Discipline and Institutionalization of Bioethics

The origin of the discipline of bioethics in the USA goes hand in hand with the origin of its institutionalization. At the beginning of this complex process, bioethics was seen as more or less identical with medical ethics−the latter notion is first mentioned by Thomas Percival (1803) −and was mainly conducted by philosophers, theologians, and a few physicians. Animal ethics and environmental ethics are sub-disciplines which emerged at a later date. In the beginning, the great demand for medical ethics was grounded in reaction to some negative events, such as the research experiments on human subjects committed by the Nazis and the Tuskegee Syphilis Study (1932–1972) in the USA. At that time, bioethics was rather driven by urgent cases (“putting out fires”) and did not consider systematic problems in healthcare such as the access to quality care. However, in reaction to these horrible events, the Nuremberg Code (1947) and the Declaration of Helsinki (1964) were created in order to provide researchers and physicians with ethical guidelines. In the case of the Tuskegee Syphilis Study (Belmont Report 1979), and other experiments in clinical research (Beecher 1966), one has to concede however that they were performed in the full knowledge of both sets of guidelines (and hence against the basic and most important idea of individual informed consent).

In particular, the idea of individual informed consent is due to the Prussian and German bureaucratic regulations of 1900/01 that appeal to the case of Dr. Albert Neisser in 1896 who publicly announced his concern about the possible dangers to the experimental subjects whom he vaccinated with an experimental immunizing serum (Zentralblatt der gesamten Unterrichtsverwaltung in Preussen 1901: 188). Additionally, the investigation of the death of 75 German children caused by the use of experimental tuberculosis vaccines in 1931 revealed that the mandatory informed consent was not obtained (Rundschreiben des Reichsministers des Inneren 28.2.1931, in: Sass 1989: 362-366). Baker rightly states that “the informed consent doctrine was thus originally a regulatory innovation created by Prussian bureaucrats; it was not an artefact of American legal or philosophical culture but of German bureaucratic culture. It was a German solution to problems created by the advances of German biomedical science” (Baker 1998: 250).

Furthermore, influential books such as Morals and Medicine: The Moral Problems of the Patient’s Right to Know the Truth, Contraception, Artificial Insemination, Sterilization, and Euthanasia (Fletcher 1954) and Ramsey’s ground breaking book, The Patient as Person: Explorations in Medical Ethics (1970) argued that there was a serious and urgent need for thinking about complex moral issues in medicine and thereby facilitated the creation of the new academic discipline of  medical ethics (also known as bioethics).

Against this background, the Institute of Society, Ethics, and the Life Sciences (1969), later known as the Hastings Center, and the Joseph and Rose Kennedy Center for the Study of Human Reproduction and Bioethics (1971) were created. They were the first two (academic) institutions to conduct research in medical ethics and to publish high quality academic journals: the Hastings Center Report and the Kennedy Institute of Ethics Journal. Many bioethics programs and degrees were established at universities in the USA during the 1970s and 1980s in order to provide students−most notably medical, law, and public policy students−with some expertise in medical ethics to deal with complex cases. In the early years, the bioethics programs were mainly funded by foundations such as the Rockefeller Foundation, the Russell Sage Foundation, the Ford Foundation and others, as well as by donations from individuals such as the Kennedy family.

The need for medical ethics experts and commissions was fostered by a series of important events in medicine, especially the Harvard Definition of Brain Death (1968), Roe v. Wade (1973), the Karen Ann Quinlan case (1975), and Baby Doe (1982). Since, most hospitals in the USA provide clinical ethics consultation that is mainly due to the requirement of The Joint Commission for Accreditation of Healthcare Organizations---in 2007 renamed the Joint Commission---that accredited hospitals must have a method for addressing ethical issues that arise (JCAHO 1992: 106).

Furthermore, new technologies in the life sciences caused new inventions and possibilities for the survival of the sick; kidney dialysis, intensive care units, organ transplantation, and respirators, to name just a few. Severe problems concerning the just distribution of health care resources emerged, for example, in access to kidney dialysis and intensive care units due to the consequences of scarcity, which caused much debate (concerning problems of resource allocation, for instance). The upshot is that the origins of bioethics as a discipline and its institutionalization can be traced back to the second half of the twentieth century in the USA. Other countries then adapted to the new situation and established their own bioethics programs and institutions.

c. The Origin of Bioethics as a Phenomenon

The notion of bioethics and the origin of the discipline of bioethics and its institutionalization in academia is a modern development. The phenomenon itself, however, can be traced back, at least with any certainty, to the Hippocratic Oath in Antiquity (500 B.C.E.) in the case of medical ethics (Jonsen 2008) and possibly beyond if one considers the Code of Hammurabi (1750 B.C.E.), which contains some written provisions related to medical practice (Kuhse and Singer 2009: 4).

The idea that animals have a moral status (§4) and should be protected is based in modern moral philosophy, most notably utilitarianism, on the one hand, and the animal rights movement in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries in Europe (in particular, England and Germany) and the USA. On the other hand, Aristotle, Thomas Aquinas, and Kant had a lasting (negative) effect on the way people thought about animals and their moral status. According to Aristotle (400 B.C.E.), animals do not have a moral status and hence human beings cannot treat them unjustly. This line of thought was omnipresent during the time of the Romans and was reflected their great pleasure in animal hunts in the Colosseum and the Circus Maximus between the second century B.C.E. and the sixth century C.E. Researchers estimate that hundreds of thousands of animals were killed in order to please the public (“panem et circenses”). Only one incident is documented in the long and bloody history of cruelty against animals in Rome, when the audience sided with a group of elephants and proclaimed that the emperor showed cruelty to these majestic creatures, which was seen by the public as an “immoral act”. According to Thomas Aquinas (thirteenth century), who shaped the Christian view on the moral status of animals for several hundred years, animals have no moral status and human beings are allowed to use them for their own comfort since everything is made by God and subjected to the rule of human beings. Kant (eighteenth century) famously argued that animals have no moral status but one should treat them appropriately since cruelty against animals might have a negative effect on our behaviour towards our fellow humans, that is, the brutalization of human behaviour.

The idea of protecting nature/the environment is a contemporary thought that particularly evolved by virtue of public concern about the rapid technological developments in the twentieth century and the extreme dangers to the whole globe posed by these developments, for example, nuclear waste, water and air pollution, the clearing of tropical forests, and global warming. The point is, however, that a concern for bioethical issues is much older than the name of the phenomenon itself and the academic discipline.

3. Sub-disciplines in Bioethics

a. Introduction

Bioethics is a discipline of applied ethics and comprises three main sub-disciplines: medical ethics, animal ethics, and environmental ethics. Even though they are “distinct” branches in focusing on different areas---namely, human beings, animals, and nature---they have a significant overlap of particular issues, vital conceptions and theories as well as prominent lines of argumentation. Solving bioethical issues is a complex and demanding task. An interesting analogy in this case is that of a neural network in which the neural knot can be compared to the bioethical problem, and the network itself can be compared to the many different links to other vital issues and moral problems on different levels (and regarding different disciplines and sub-disciplines). Sometimes it seems that the attempt to settle a moral problem stirs up a hornets’ nest because many plausible suggestions cause further (serious) issues. However, a brief overview of the bioethical sub-disciplines is as follows.

b. Medical Ethics

The oldest sub-discipline of bioethics is medical ethics which can be traced back to the introduction of the Hippocratic Oath (500 B.C.E.). Of course, medical ethics is not limited to the Hippocratic Oath; rather that marks the beginning of Western ethical reasoning and decision making in medicine. The Hippocratic Oath is a compilation of ancient texts concerning the proper behaviour of physicians and the relationship between physician and patient. It also contains some binding ethical rules of utmost importance such as the well known principle of non-maleficence (“primum non nocere”) and the principle of beneficence (“salus aegroti suprema lex”); furthermore, doctor-patient confidentiality and the prohibition on exploiting the patient (including sexual exploitation) are important rules that are still valid.

Other more critical elements of the Hippocratic Oath such as the strict prohibition of euthanasia and abortion seem to be rather debatable and raise the vital question of how to distinguish between valuable and less valuable principles it proposes. In contemporary bioethics, euthanasia is---in general---widely regarded as an eligible autonomous decision of the patient that must be respected. With regard to abortion, most bioethicists believe that it should be allowed, at least, under certain circumstances, but this issue is still hotly debated and causes many emotional responses. The upshot is that one needs a more fundamental theoretical analysis of the particular elements of the Hippocratic Oath in order to determine possible traditional shortcomings in more detail before one accepts them as a fixed set of unquestionable professional rules. Furthermore, the idea that “the physician knows best” and should be able to act against the will of the patient for the benefit of the patient (that is, the patriarchal model of the physician-patient relationship) also originated in ancient times. The competence of the physician was too overwhelming for most people so that they almost always complied with the physician’s advice.

In medical ethics, one is concerned with the general ethical question of “what should one do” under the particular circumstances of medicine. In this respect, medical ethics is not different from basic ethics but it is limited to the area of medicine and deals with its particular state of affairs.

There are a number of important traditional issues in medical ethics that still need to be solved. These include beginning- and end-of-life issues (notably abortion, euthanasia, and limiting therapeutic treatments), the physician-patient relationship, research on human beings (including research ethics and human genetics). More recent medical issues include reproductive decision making, organ transplantation, just distribution of healthcare resources, access to healthcare, and most recently vital issues concerning healthcare systems and (global) public health. In the twentieth century, medical ethics was focused on−but not limited to− two main issues: the concept of personhood (for example, the Singer debate) and the principle of autonomy (that is, individual informed consent). The rise of autonomy in the context of the physician-patient relationship can be seen as the counter-movement to paternalism in healthcare. Both vital issues pervaded many debates in medical ethics in the past and can been seen as key issues that shaped the discussions in academia, at the theoretical level, and were highly influential on the ward, that is in practice, as well.

c. Animal Ethics

The history of ethics is to some extent a history of who is and should be part of the moral community. Roughly speaking, in Antiquity only men of a particular social status were part of the moral community; several hundred years later, after a long and hard social struggle women achieved equal status with men−even though there is still a long way to go in many parts of most societies (for example, in the job market and equal pay for equal work). The idea that animals should be part of the moral community mainly evolved in the context of the ethics of utilitarianism in the nineteenth century, most notably spearheaded by Jeremy Bentham, who famously argued that it does not matter morally whether animals can reason but rather whether they can suffer. In addition, animal rights groups were founded in the USA and Europe (in particular, in Protestant England and Germany) by virtue of a new awareness of sensitivity towards cruelty against animals (for example, vivisection) and a growing feeling of compassion for the suffering of animals in general (see Schopenhauer). This new paradigmatic moral shift was supported by the scientific findings of Darwin’s evolutionary theory. The findings undermined the sharp (empirical) distinction between human and animal posed by the traditional natural rights position that only rational human beings are part of the moral community (see also the objection of speciesism, §3d). Evolutionary theory provides convincing empirical evidence that there is a natural kinship between human beings and animals in the sense that human beings evolved from animals through  a long, gradual process.

Current problems include research on animals (including vivisection), livestock farming and animal transports, xenotransplantation, human-animal chimera, meat eating versus vegetarianism/veganism, the legitimacy of zoos and circuses, religious freedom versus animal protection, recreational hunting, and the growing conflict between the protection of the environment and animal welfare. These pose complex moral issues that need to be addressed appropriately by responding to the question of whether animals have a moral status in general (and why), and, if they do, what their exact moral rank is.

All ethical viewpoints defending the protection of animals broaden the scope of the traditional position by claiming that the ability to suffer is the key point and hence sentient beings should be protected as part of the moral community. Two ground-breaking and highly influential books written by the utilitarian Peter Singer (1975) and Tom Regan (1983), who favors a Kantian-oriented approach, were the starting point of a more sophisticated discussion in academia and which also influenced many laypeople across the world. Singer argues for a utilitarian animal ethics based on the equal consideration of interests of sentient beings in combination with the criterion of the ability to feel pain. Regan claims instead that sentient beings who are able to see themselves as “subjects of life” do have an “inherent value” which provides them with strong defensible moral rights that implicate prima facie duties for human beings towards animals. Other  ethical approaches contribute important insights as well. Virtue ethics calls for one not to undermine the aspiration of the good life by acting in a cruel way towards animals but acknowledge the animal-like part of one's existence (Midgley 1984). Feminist care ethics implies animals stand in an asymmetrical relation of care and responsibility towards human beings (Donovan and Adams 1996). Discourse ethics implies animals are part of the moral community through the voice of a surrogate decision maker (Habermas 1997).

d. Environmental Ethics

Generally speaking, environmental ethics deals with the moral dimension of the relationship between human beings and non-human nature−animals and plants, local populations, natural resources and ecosystems,  landscapes, as well as the biosphere and the cosmos. Strictly speaking, human beings are, of course, part of nature and it seems somewhat odd to claim that there is a contrast between human beings and non-human nature. At second glance, however, it seems reasonable to make this distinction because human beings are the only beings who are able to reason about the consequences of their actions which may influence the whole of nature or parts of nature in a positive or negative way.

Ideas about the “right” conduct concerning the environment are as old as humankind but the establishment of environmental ethics as an academic discipline dates back to the 1970s when issues of vital importance emerged, such as the global threat to the natural basis of existence, the growing number of extinct species, the destruction of ecosystems and natural resources, as well as the more recognized dangers of technological inventions---for example, nuclear power, including its radioactive waste, and the new biotechnologies like genetic engineering. The exploitation of the environment was first justified by the religious teachings of the Old Testament (such as the stewardship of the environment in the Bible) and, during the secular period of the Enlightenment, supported by Francis Bacon’s scientific program to (rigorously) disclose all the secrets of nature. René Descartes’ famous and influential dualism of rational beings, on the one hand, and soulless matter, on the other hand, led to the debasement of nature, including animals, since the objects of morality were by nature rational beings only. The first serious counter-movement can be traced back to the Romantic philosophies of nature of the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries. In the non-Western context, the idea of respect for and valuing nature is more prevalent and at least 2500 years old, referring to the general teachings of Hinduism and Buddhism which influenced the Western view in Europe in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries (for example, Schopenhauer). Of course, contemporary environmentalists, particularly feminist ethicists and supporters of the idea of natural aesthetics, have refined the criticism of the traditional view by claiming that animals and nature are not valueless but deserving of moral protection.

It is possible to make the following broad distinctions regarding environmental ethics. Environmental ethics is commonly divided into two distinct areas: (i) anthropocentrism and (ii) non-anthropocentrism (or physiocentrism). Anthropocentric approaches such as virtue ethics and deontology stress the particular human perspective, and claim that values depend on human beings only. Values are relational and require a rational being, hence animals and non-human nature are not per se objects of morality, unless indirectly, by virtue of a surrogate decision maker. According to the anthropocentric view, only (rational) human beings deserve moral protection although one should respect and protect nature either for the sake of human beings (instrumental view) or for the sake of nature itself (non-instrumental view). Anthropocentrism is faced with the objection of speciesism, the view that the mere affiliation to the species of Homo sapiens is sufficient to grant a higher moral status to human beings in comparison with animals. Singer has powerfully claimed, however, that the “mere difference of species in itself cannot determine moral status” (Singer 2009: 567).

Non-anthropocentrism (or physiocentrism) mainly consists of three main branches: (1) pathocentrism, (2) biocentrism, and (3) ecocentrism, which can be further divided into an individualistic and holistic version. All non-anthropocentric approaches share the common claim that there are “objective” or more straightforward naturalistic values which are non-relational (intrinsic) and do not presuppose rational human beings. Nature (including animals) itself is valuable, independently of whether there are any human beings or not (non-instrumental view), even though one has to acknowledge the fact that many arguments about intrinsic value also have instrumental underpinnings. Supporters of pathocentrism argue that all sentient beings deserve moral consideration and protection, equally/egalitarian or non-equally/non-egalitarian with reference to human beings (see Singer 1975, Regan 1983, Wolf 1996). Adherents of biocentrism claim that all beings should be part of the moral community. Finally, supporters of ecocentrism argue that the whole of nature deserves moral protection, either according to an individualistic or holistic approach. If individualistically, all “things” in nature are bearers of moral values and are of equal moral worth. If holistically, there are traditionally at least three main positions: (a) ecofeminism, (b) deep ecology, and (c) the land ethics. Ecofeminists believe that there is a parallel between the systems of domination that affect both women and nature. Therefore, if human beings are willing to change the way they act towards nature, they must understand the real causes of the problem−the idea that nature is rather irrational and passive as well as needing to be controlled by human beings (Plumwood 1986, Warren 1987). According to deep ecologists, human beings should view themselves as being a part of and not distinct from the natural world by virtue of a refined notion of the self. All living things, according to the founder of deep ecology, Arne Naess, have an equal right to flourish (“biospherical egalitarianism”). Proponents of the land ethics argue that one should stop  treating the land as a mere resource, but view it as a precious source of energy. Aldo Leopold, the founder of land ethics, famously claims: “A thing is right when it tends to preserve the integrity, stability, and beauty of the biotic community. It is wrong when it tends otherwise.” (Leopold 1949/1989: 218-225).

4. The Idea of Moral Status in Bioethics

Bioethical debates, particularly in animal ethics and environmental ethics, are concerned with issues of moral status and moral protection. The vital question is, for example, whether all animals have a moral status and hence are members of the moral community enjoying moral protection or whether they do not have a moral status at all (or only to some degree for some animals, such as higher mammals such as great apes, dolphins and elephants). But, even if animals do not have a moral status and hence have no moral rights, it could be the case that they still are morally significant in the sense that human beings are not allowed to do whatever they want to do with them (for example, to torture animals for fun). The fundamental idea of granting a living being a moral status is to protect the particular being from various kinds of harm which undermine the being's flourishing. For example, one can protect the great apes by granting them a moral status which is important for their survival since one can then legally enforce their moral right not to be killed.

But what are the prerequisites for ascribing a being a moral status and hence moral rights and (legal) protection? And, furthermore, what about non-sentient nature, such as tropical rainforests, the Grand Canyon, mammoth trees, and beautiful landscapes? Do they have a moral status as well? Are they morally significant at least to some degree? Or are human beings allowed to do whatever they want to do with non-human nature?

Traditionally, philosophers made the distinction between sentient beings and non-sentient beings (including the environment) and argued that only beings who have an intrinsic worth are valuable and hence deserve moral concern and (legal) protection. Therefore, it is the intrinsic worth of the particular being that is important for the ascription of the being’s moral status as well as the being’s moral and legal protection. If a being has no intrinsic worth, then it has no moral status, and so forth. It has been commonly argued that the intrinsic worth of a being can be fleshed out by claiming that it is rationality or the capacity to reason which is the underlying motif for ascribing “intrinsic worth” (for example, Kant). This line of reasoning is anthropocentric and is faced with the objection of speciesism (§3d). A somewhat different view is, for example, to claim that even the Grand Canyon has an intrinsic worth by virtue of its uniqueness and great beauty. In this respect, the notion of intrinsic worth is fleshed out by the idea of uniqueness and beauty and hence one avoids (to some degree) anthropocentrism and the objection of speciesism. But, on the other hand, this position seems questionable for at least two important reasons. First, “being unique” seems to be of no moral importance at all. For example, if a dog was born with two heads, one might say that this is unique but it would seem awkward to grant the dog protection by virtue of his two heads. Rather, one would be more likely to protect him in order to study the dog's particular abnormality. This, however, has nothing to do with the dog’s supposed intrinsic worth based on his uniqueness but everything to do with his instrumental value for some scientists. Secondly, to say that something (or someone) is “beautiful” seems to presuppose a sentient being that values the particular thing in the first place; hence we are not concerned with an intrinsic worth but rather with an instrumental worth with reference to a particular valuer. According to this reasoning, the Grand Canyon should be protected since it causes great experiences in people who stand in awe of this landscape when they appreciate the great beauty of it and simply feel good about it.

Some scholars argue that one has to be cautious of examining the moral status of non-human nature through the lens of a purely anthropocentric line of reasoning because it conceptually downplays the value of animals and the environment right from the start. However, on the other hand, many people find it questionable to argue for the moral rights of stones, sunflowers, and earthworms. Even so, it seems plausible to consider that there might be a significant distinction between the moral status of stones, sunflowers, and earthworms by virtue of their instrumental value for human beings. For example, the Grand Canyon might have a certain moral status because this unique stone formation makes human beings not only view it with awe, but also aesthetically admire it, which is the reason not to deliberately destroy the Grand Canyon. Sunflowers are nice to look at and hence are enjoyable for human beings, therefore one should not deliberately destroy them; earthworms are useful for the thriving of plants (including sunflowers) which is good both for animals and human beings since they loosen the ground, and hence they should not be deliberately destroyed as well. The differing moral status of stones, sunflowers, and earthworms---if there is any---could then be eventually ranked according to their particular instrumental value for human beings. Or one could argue that stones, sunflowers, and earthworms have an intrinsic (that is, non-instrumental) value in so far as they are valuable as such. Then, a possible ranking concerning their moral status might either depend on their supposed usefulness for other entities (a case of intrinsic value with instrumental underpinnings) or on a fixed general order of non-instrumental values: first, animals, second, animated plants, and third, the most inanimate, such as stones. Against this fixed order, however, some people could object that mammoth trees---the gigantic several hundred years old majestic trees---should be ranked higher than simple earthworms because they are very rare and make human beings view them with awe.  That is, it might well be the case that sometimes animated plants such as majestic mammoth trees morally outweigh lower forms of animals such as earthworms. Furthermore, one could even argue, then, that the Grand Canyon morally outweighs a group of majestic mammoth trees and so forth. As a result, it seems reasonable to acknowledge the fact that there is no easy way to determine: (1) The exact moral status between different life forms within the animated group, as well as the moral status between the animated and the most inanimated in non-human nature, and (2) the exact moral status between human and non-human nature, if one does not hold the view that human beings have the same moral standing as animals and plants (that is, human beings and non-human nature).

Thus, one might eventually conclude that, in general, morally appropriate conduct towards non-human nature should focus on paying attention to the many details of the particular case and the consequences of one’s actions. In sum, do no premeditated harm (for example, do not torture animals for fun, restrain large-scale livestock farming), preserve nature wherever it is possible (by, for example, avoiding water and air pollution and protecting tropical rainforests from clearing). As Hans Jonas famously put it, be responsible in your dealings with non-human nature.

5. Theory in Bioethics

a. Introduction

Bioethics is an important inter-disciplinary and rapidly emerging field of applied ethics. The traditional but deficient view concerning ethical reasoning and decision making in applied ethics is that one simply “applies” a particular ethical theory such as utilitarianism or deontology in a given context such as business (business ethics), politics (political ethics), or issues related to human health (medical ethics) in order to solve the moral problem in question. This top-down approach of ethical reasoning and decision making adheres to the idea that ethics is quite similar to geometry, in that it presupposes a solid foundation from which principles and general rules can be inferred and then applied to concrete cases independent of the details of the particular case. The locus of certitude, that is, the place of the greatest certainty for principle ethics---approaches using one master principle---concerns its foundation; the reasonableness of the ethical decision is passed on from the foundation itself.

This picture is awry. In the twentieth century it was clearly shown that the traditional ethical theories had great difficulty in solving the new contemporary problems such as nuclear power and its radioactive waste, issues related to the new biotechnologies (for example, genetic enhancement, cloning), and so on. The consequences were, first, that the two main classical theories in principle ethics---deontology and utilitarianism---were modified in order to deal more properly and successfully with the new situation. For example, Christine Korsgaard modified Kantianism and Richard Hare modified utilitarianism. Secondly, new approaches of ethical reasoning and decision making were developed, such as Beauchamp and Childress’s four-principle approach in bioethics and feminist bioethics. Casuistry and virtue ethics---the bottom-up approaches---were rediscovered and refined in order to examine complex bioethical issues. The rise of applied ethics in general and the rise of bioethics in particular has been faced with an overwhelming variety of details and complex circumstances with regard to the rapidly emerging ethical issues against the background of the fast development of new technologies and the process of globalization, accompanied by an awakening of individual autonomy and the rejection of being submissive to authority. Sound ethical approaches in applied ethics must at least fulfill two criteria: (1) They must be consistent and (2) they must be applicable. These are the minimum conditions for any successful ethical theory in applied ethics.

In addition, one might raise the issue of reaching an agreement about what to do in practice against the background of competing moral theories. There is a twofold response to this well-known problem. First, most cases (for example, clinical ethics consultations, commission work, and so forth) reveal that there is a broad consensus among people concerning the results (practical level) but that they---quite often---differ considerably in their justifications at the theoretical level. Secondly, it might well be the case---as some scholars such as Gert and Beauchamp claim---that some people without adhering to moral relativism have equally good reasons about what to do in practice but, nonetheless, still differ about what and why it should be done. Contrary to the first response, the second response is more alarming since the idea that people could have equally good reasons for differing suggestions seems odd, at least at first sight. At second glance, however, moral judgements might not only depend on pure reason alone but are influenced by different cultures, religions, and traditions that would substantiate the claim of different outcomes and justifications. Whether one is, then, necessarily committed to a form of moral relativism can be reasonably questioned since one can still make the convincing distinction between a hard core of moral norms that is universally shared (for example, that one should not commit murder or lie and that one should help people in need) and other moral norms which are non-universal by nature. If that is correct, then this would solve the issue of moral relativism.

The following brief depiction of (bio)ethical theories, including their main points of criticism, provides an overview of the  approaches (see also Düwell and Steigleder 2003: 41-210; Kuhse and Singer 2009: 65-125).

b. Deontological Approaches

Deontological approaches such as provided by Kant (1785) and Ross (1930) are commonly characterized by applying usually strict moral rules or norms to concrete cases. Religious approaches, such as those of the Catholic Church, and non-religious deontological approaches, such as Kantian-oriented theories, are prime examples of applying moral rules. For example, the (extreme) conservative position of the Catholic Church justifies that one should not abort fetuses, under any circumstances, including in cases of rape (Noonan 1970) and forbids the use of condoms. Furthermore, the Catholic Church regularly defends its strict religious position in end-of-life cases to prolong human life as long as possible and not to practice euthanasia (or physician-assisted suicide) because human life is sacred and given as a gift from God. In this respect, religious approaches are necessarily faced with the objection of speciesism, if they claim that it is sufficient to be a member of the human species in order to be protected. Kantian-oriented approaches, instead, are not necessarily faced with this objection because---at least, in the original version---moral status is assigned according to “rationality” and not according to “membership of the human species”. Other Neo-Kantian deontological approaches, however, might emphasize “human dignity” and hence run into serious troubles with regard to the objection of speciesism as well. In other words, there is a fundamental disagreement inherent in the notion of human dignity---roughly, the idea that there is something special about human beings---and the ascription of moral status to non-human nature such as animals and plants.

Kantian-oriented deontological approaches (or Kantianism) generally adhere to the basic Kantian ideas of respect for persons and human dignity; both central ideas are rooted in the human being’s capacity to act autonomously. Kantianism has been adopted in order to provide a justification for strict truth telling in medical contexts, for example, in cases of terminal cancer, bedside rationing, and medical experiments. This development can be seen as a counter-movement against previous malpractice. The former practice consisted in not telling the truth to the patient in order either not to cause additional harm or not to undermine the goals of the medical experiments (for example, the Tuskegee Syphilis Study). In the late 20th century, this has changed by virtue of acknowledging the patient's right to be told the truth about his or her health condition. Likewise, regarding the patient’s involvement in research studies---including research with placebos---in order to enable the patient to make adequate autonomous decisions (that is, individual informed consent). The second formula of Kant’s Categorical Imperative---“Act in such a way that you treat humanity, whether in your own person or in the person of any other, never merely as a means to an end, but always at the same time as an end” (Kant 1785/1968)---has been successfully used in different medical contexts in order to avoid abuses. In particular, it is nowadays used to avoid abuses in research experiments on human subjects. The sad examples of the Tuskegee Syphilis Study and the Human Radiation Experiments clearly show the dangers of researchers acting in a highly dubious and immoral way (see, The Belmont Report 1979). Additionally, deontological approaches have been used in the fields of animal ethics (Regan 1983, Korsgaard 1996, 2004, Wood 1998) and environmental ethics (Taylor 1986, Korsgaard 1996). Altman (2011) offers a thorough examination of the strengths and weaknesses of Kant’s ethics concerning a vast range of important bioethical issues in contemporary applied ethics.

Genuine religious approaches are problematic by virtue of their strong commitment to religious presuppositions such as the existence of God as the ultimate source of morality or the absolute sacredness of the human life. In modern---or rather secular---societies, this line of reasoning cannot be taken as a universal starting point to justify moral norms for religious and non-religious people alike in medical contexts on issues such as abortion, euthanasia, the use of contraceptives, and genetic enhancement. Despite the prima facie reasonableness of Kantian-oriented deontological approaches in cases concerning truth telling and in the context of medical exploitation, they particularly suffer from using moral norms too general and abstract  to be applied without difficulty or stiltedness to concrete cases. The upshot is that deontological approaches are less effective at providing adequate guidance since their application is too complex and possibly misleading (for a different view, see Altman 2011) or causes strong counter-intuitive intuitions in the case of religious positions.

c. Utilitarianism

One of the most prominent and influential ways of ethical reasoning and decision making in the field of bioethics is based on utilitarianism. In the late twentieth century, utilitarian approaches were so influential that many people outside academia believed that all bioethicists were utilitarians. Utilitarianism, in fact, contains a wide range of different approaches, but one can distinguish four important core elements that all utilitarian approaches have in common:

  1. The consequence principle: The consequences of a given action are the measure of its moral quality.
  2. The utility principle: The moral rightness and wrongness of actions are determined by the greatest possible utility for the greatest possible number of all sentient beings.
  3. The hedonistic principle: The consequences of a given action are evaluated with reference to a particular value. This particular prime value can be as follows: (1) Promoting pleasure, or (2) avoiding pain, or (3) satisfaction of interests or considered preferences, or (4) satisfaction of some objective criteria of well-being, and so forth.
  4. The universal principle: Maximize the total utility for all sentient beings affected.

Utilitarian approaches in bioethics were spearheaded by Singer (1979) and Harris (1975) and carried on by, among others, Savulescu (2001, 2002) and Schüklenk (2010). Such approaches in bioethics are less concerned with public welfare than other vital aspects, such as: (1) debunking the traditional religious views on the sacredness of human beings, the prohibition of abortion, infanticide, and euthanasia; (2) stressing the importance of non-rational sentient animals (animal ethics) and the preservation of nature (environmental ethics) against anthropocentric approaches such as Kantianism and religious approaches; (3) arguing against the use of human rights and human dignity in bioethical discourses; (4) maximizing the patient’s well-being or best interests in medicine. In this context, utilitarians claim that one should focus on the patient avoiding pain and suffering, and therefore one should, for example, allow terminally ill patients to obtain physician-assisted suicide. Furthermore, the religious idea that human life is sacred and hence must be protected from the moment of conception is rejected by utilitarians who believe that religious claims are unsubstantiated and incompatible with the requirements of a modern, secular nation-state (for example, research on human embryos and genetic enhancement should be made possible). In addition, abortion and infanticide in cases where the baby has a severe disability should be possible depending on the circumstances of the particular case and by appealing to the idea of personhood (Singer 1979, Kuhse and Singer 1985, Giubilini and Minerva 2012). According to Singer, one should not be allowed to kill a human being or sentient animal if one can detect in that being rationality and self-consciousness---the core elements of personhood according to Singer. To treat sentient animals with interests differently than human beings is speciesism which is comparable to sexism and racism and must be avoided. Moral judgements, according to utilitarians, should always be impartial and universal. Singer (1975) additionally claims that human beings must consider the equal interests of human beings and animals alike.

The general idea to always maximize the patient’s well-being according to a rather simplistic idea of calculating and comparing the pleasures and pains of all affected persons seems questionable to many people since they do not think that the outcome of these calculations necessarily leads to morally right or wrong actions. Furthermore, the claim that the killing of an innocent being in the case of a fetus with a (severe) disability might be the best possible outcome in some situations---by adhering to “the good life” doctrine---seems to undermine some important values of living together (compassion, care, responsibility for the weak, justice). In addition, the idea that minority groups such as people with (severe) disabilities and patients in a permanent vegetative state can be legitimately sacrificed in some cases has led to a rather bad reputation for utilitarian approaches. Utilitarians are also at odds with approaches in bioethics that appeal to human dignity and human rights. Two centuries ago, Bentham famously stated that natural rights (or human rights) are “nonsense upon stilts,” a dictum most utilitarians still regard as reasonable.

d. The Four-Principle Approach

One of the most important approaches in bioethics or medical ethics is the four-principle approach developed by Tom Beauchamp and James Childress (1978, latest edition 2009). Since then they have continually refined their approach and integrated the points of criticism raised by their opponents, most notably Gert et al. (1990). The four-principle approach, often simply called principlism, consists of four universal prima facie mid-level ethical principles: (1) autonomy, (2) non-maleficence, (3) beneficence, and (4) justice. Together with some general rules and ethical virtues, they can be seen as the starting point and constraining framework of ethical reasoning and decision making (“common morality”). According to Beauchamp and Childress:

The common morality is the set of norms shared by all persons committed to morality. The common morality is not merely a morality, in contrast to other moralities. The common morality is applicable to all persons in all places, and we rightly judge all human conduct by its standards. (2009: 3)

Particular moralities, instead, contain non-universal moral norms which stem from different cultural, religious, and institutional sources. These norms---unlike the abstract and content-thin principles of the common morality---are concrete and rich in substance. Beauchamp and Childress use the methods of specification and balancing to enrich the abstract and content-thin universal principles with empirical data from the particular moralities. The method of specification is, according to Beauchamp,

...a methodological tool that adds content to abstract principles, ridding them of their indeterminateness and providing action-guiding content for the purpose of coping with complex cases. Many already specified norms will need further specification to handle new circumstances of indeterminateness and conflict. (Beauchamp 2011: 301)

The method of balancing, instead, is important for reaching sound judgements in individual cases and it can be seen as “the process of finding reasons to support beliefs about which moral norms should prevail” (Beauchamp and Childress 2009: 20). Since the particular moralities are different, people sometimes specify and balance the principles differently, and hence principlists often claim “that there can be different and equally good solutions to moral problems” (Gordon et al. 2011: 299).

Even though the four-principle approach certainly belongs to the most prevalent, authoritative, and widely used bioethical approaches, this approach has not been unquestioned and has provoked serious objections. The three most important objections are: first, the lack of ethical guidance because there is no master principle in cases of conflict among the principles (Gert et al. 1990); secondly, the problem of bias concerning the universal principles in cross-cultural contexts (Takala 2001, Westra et al. 2009, Gordon 2011), and thirdly, the objection that the four-principle approach is a mere checklist of considerations and so methodologically unsound (Gert et al. 1990).

e. Virtue Ethics

The revival of virtue ethics in moral philosophy in the last century was most notably spearheaded by Anscombe (1958), MacIntyre (1981), Williams (1985), Nussbaum (1988, 1990), and more recently Hursthouse (1987, 1999), Slote (2001), Swanton (2003), and Oakley (2009). This approach also deeply influenced the ethical reasoning and decision making in the field of bioethics, particularly in medical ethics (for example, Foot 1977, Shelp 1985, Hursthouse 1991, Pellegrino 1995, Pellegrino and Thomasma 2003, McDougall 2007).

The general idea of virtue ethical approaches in bioethics is that one should act in accordance with what the virtuous agent would have chosen. In more detail, an action is morally right if it is done by adhering to the ethical virtues in order to promote human flourishing and well-being; the action is morally good if the person in question acts on the basis of the right motive as well as his or her action is based on a firm and good character or disposition. That means an action that is morally right (for instance, to help the needy) but performed according to the wrong motive (such as to gain honour and reputation) is not morally good. The right action and the right motive must both come together in virtue ethics. For a detailed view of how contemporary virtue ethics focuses on action and the rightness of action against the background of the general idea of living a good life, see in particular Hursthouse (1999: chapters 1-3), Swanton (2003: chapter 11), and Slote (2001: chapter 1).

Generally speaking, virtue ethical approaches put a lot of weight on the particular agent. For example, the virtuous physician in medical ethics should not only be a well trained and conscientious professional---one who shows compassion towards his or her patients, is helpful and honest, and keeps his or her promises---but also should be strongly inclined to promote the patient’s well-being even at his or her own expense (Pellegrino 1989). The virtuous agent in bioethics knows how to deal with complex cases, shows a greater sensitivity than proponents of deontological and utilitarian approaches, and acts virtuously not only by complying with moral norms but also “going the extra mile” to perform supererogatory actions. Virtue ethical approaches have been applied in medical ethics by, for example, Foot on euthanasia (1977), Lebacqz on the virtuous patient (1985), Hursthouse on abortion (1991), Oakley and Cocking on professional roles (2001), and Holland on virtue politics (2011). The role of virtue ethics in the field of environmental ethics has been examined by Frasz (1993) and Hursthouse (2007), and in the field of animal ethics by Hursthouse (2011) and Merriam (2011).

It is a matter of debate (see for example, Kihlbom 2000, Holland 2011), whether the strengths of virtue ethical approaches are limited to single cases (individual level) or whether they are also equally good candidates in cases of developing biomedical procedures for regulatory policy (societal level). In addition, Jansen (2000), for example, argues that virtue ethical approaches face two serious problems, which cannot be sufficiently resolved by adhering to virtue ethics. First is the problem of content: vague virtues are unable to give proper guidance. Second is the problem of pluralism: competing conceptions of the good life complicate a sound solution. Virtues only have a limited function; for example, in the context of medicine they should enable the physician to become a virtuous practitioner abiding by the right motive. But, even in this case, Jansen claims that the right action should prevail over the right motive. Furthermore, sometimes opponents such as Jansen (2000) claim that virtues are relative by nature and hence lack proper guidance in the context of global bioethics (the “problem of cultural relativity”). However, Nussbaum (1988) argues persuasively, by appealing to Aristotle, that ethical virtues are non-relative by nature and allow for variations.

f. Casuistry

The revival of casuistry as an inductive method of ethical reasoning and decision making in the second half of the twentieth century coincides with a wide and persistent critique of principle-oriented approaches, most notably principlism, deontological ethics, and utilitarianism in bioethics. Casuistry had its historical heyday in moral theology and ethics during the period from the fifteenth to the seventeenth century in Europe. After a long time of no importance or influence in moral philosophy, it gained a significant importance in bioethics---mostly in clinical ethics---after the vital publications of Jonsen and Toulmin (1988), Strong (1988), and Brody (1988). Casuists attack the traditional idea of simply applying universal moral rules and norms to complex cases in order to solve the problem in question---that is, a moral theory justifies a moral principle (or several principles) which in turn justifies a moral rule (or several rules) which in turn justifies the moral judgement concerning a particular case. The circumstances make the case and are of utmost importance in order to yield a good solution (see moral particularism).

Whether the casuists’ solution always leads to an open-and-shut case appears questionable and depends largely on the paradigm cases and analogies that are used to determine and evaluate the case in question as well as the skills of the particular casuist (in finding proper paradigm cases and analogies, and so on.). For example, Strong (1988) claims that it might be that a complex case lies right in between two reference cases and hence one is unable to find a clear solution; in such a case different solutions might be equally justified. In general, casuists argue that universal principles and rules are unable to solve complex cases in a sufficient way since the complexity of the moral life is too great (for example, Toulmin 1982, Brody 1988). The general strategy in casuistry can be described as follows:

  1. Depiction of the case: A thorough depiction of the empirical and moral elements of the given case lays out the basic structure and the decisive problems. Vital questions are: (a) What are the particulars of the case (who, what, where, when, how much)? (b) What are the basic questions in the relevant area (in medical ethics: what are the medical indications, what are the patient’s preferences, evaluating the quality of life, consider and respect the context of the treatment)?
  2. Classification of the case: Once the given case is thoroughly depicted, one must classify the case by finding paradigm cases and  analogies by analogical reasoning. Paradigm cases and analogies function as the background against which the given case is evaluated. They help to determine the important similarities and differences of the specifics of the case.
  3. Moral judgement: Once the specific similarities and differences of the case are determined, the casuists evaluate the results by adhering to common sense morality and the basic values of the community.

Case sensitivity and the (partial) integration of cultural and community bound values and expectations are, in general, advantageous in ethical reasoning and decision making. But it seems equally true that this approach presents some difficulties as well. As critics such as Arras (1991), Wildes (1993), and Tomlinson (1994) have argued, it is impossible to take a critical standpoint if one is deeply rooted in one’s own tradition, value system, and social community, since it can be the case that the social practices and convictions are simply biased (Kopelman 1994) or unjust according to an external standpoint (Apartheid in South Africa, the caste system in India). Furthermore, casuistry seems to presuppose a widespread agreement on basic values in the community and, therefore, is doomed to failure in pluralistic cultures (Wildes 1993). Finally, casuistry may have difficulty providing solutions to rather general bioethical regulatory policies since it is completely focused on cases. Whether a series of similar cases may warrant a particular regulatory practice from a casuistical point of view is a matter of debate (see virtue ethics), but it seems fair to say that the very meaning of casuistry really concerns cases and not general rules which can be adopted as binding regulations.

g. Feminist Bioethics

Feminist bioethics can only be fully appreciated if one understands the context in which this increasingly important approach evolved during the late twentieth century (Tong 1993, Wolf 1996, Donchin and Purdy 1999, Rawlinson 2001). The social and political background of feminist bioethics is feminism and feminist theory with its major social and political goal to end the oppression of women and to empower them to become an equal gender. The apparent differences between men and women have often led cultures to treat them in radically different ways, ways that often disadvantage women. Thus women have been allocated to social roles that leave them worse off with respect to benefits enjoyed by men, such as freedom and power. Yet despite their differences in reproductive roles, women and men share many morally relevant characteristics such as rationality and the capacity for suffering, and hence deserve fundamental equality.

In more detail, the most important task in the long struggle regarding the goals of feminism was to combine two distinct features that were both vital in order to fight against traditional power relations. That is, the idea that men and women are equal and different at the same time. They are equal by virtue of gender equality and different because the proponents stress a particular feminist perspective. The combination of both aspects is, in general, a difficult task for feminist ethics since, on the one hand, the proponents must avoid the common trap of speaking in traditional dualistic ways of care versus justice, particularity versus universality, and emotion versus reason and, on the other hand, they must carve out the specific differences of the feminist perspective (Haker 2003). Historically speaking, feminist ethics developed in strong opposition to the traditional male-oriented approaches which genuinely appealed to universal moral rights and principles, such as principlism, deontological approaches and utilitarianism (Gilligan 1982, Gudorf 1994, Lebacqz 1995). Feminist ethics, instead, is construed differently by adhering to a context-sensitive and particularist ethics of care as well as by appealing to core values such as responsibility, relational autonomy, care, compassion, freedom, and equality (Gilligan 1982, Noddings 1984, Jagger 1992). The ethics of care, however, is a necessary but not sufficient depiction of feminist ethics since the latter has, in general, become more refined and sophisticated with its different branches (Tong 1989, Cole and Coultrap-McQuin 1992).

Feminist bioethics developed from the early 1970s on and was initially focused on medical ethics (Holmes and Purdy 1992, Warren 1992, Tong 1997); proponents later extended the areas of interest to issues in the fields of animal and environmental ethics (Plumwood 1986, Warren, 1987, Mies and Shiva 1995, Donovan 2008). Important topics in feminist bioethics are concerned with the correct understanding of autonomy as relational autonomy (Sherwin 1992, 1998, Mackenzie and Stoljar 2000, Donchin 2001), a strong focus on care (Kittay 1999), the claim for an equal and just treatment of women in order to fight against discrimination within healthcare professions and institutions on many different levels (Miles 1991, Tong 2002). In more detail, from a feminist perspective the following bioethical issues are of great importance: abortion, reproductive medicine, justice and care, pre-implantation genetic diagnosis, sex selection, exploitation and abuse of women, female genital circumcision, breast cancer, contraception and HIV, equal access to (and quality of) healthcare and healthcare resources, global bioethics and cultural issues. The main line of reasoning is to make a well informed ethical decision which is not gender biased and to appeal to important core values. Feminist bioethics is by nature particularistic and in this respect it is similar to many virtue ethical approaches and casuistry.

Without any doubt, feminist bioethics initiated discussion of important topics, provided valuable insights, and caused a return to a more meaningful way of ethical reasoning and decision making by, for example, not only adhering to universal moral norms. On the other hand, it can be doubted whether feminist bioethics---all things considered---can be seen as a well-equipped and full moral theory. It may be that feminist bioethics complements the traditional ethical theories by adding an important and new perspective (that is, the feminist standpoint) to the debate. Several vital methodological topics still need to be clarified in more detail and put into a broader moral context---such as how to avoid the traditional dualistic way of speaking about things and at the same time stressing a particular feminist standpoint; the problem of loyalty towards family and close friends and impartiality in ethics (universalism versus particularism); and feminist bioethics and the global perspective. Developing feminist bioethics is on the agenda of many scholars working in the fields of virtue ethics and casuistry. Thus, feminist bioethics comes in for the standard objections raised by the opponents of virtue ethics and casuistry alike. Therefore, it must also defend itself against some of the above-mentioned objections that are not peculiar to feminist bioethics. To sum up, feminist bioethics adds valuable insights to debates on various bioethical topics, but may not be a well-equipped full moral theory yet.

6. References and Further Reading

a. References

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  • Anscombe, E. (1958). Modern Moral Philosophy, Philosophy, 33(124), 1-19.
  • Arras, J.D. (1991). Getting Down to Cases: The Revival of Casuistry in Bioethics, Journal of Medicine and Philosophy, 16(1), 29-51.
  • Baker, R. (1998). A Theory of International Bioethics: The Negotiable and Non-Negotiable, Kennedy Institute of Ethics Journal, 8(3), 233-273.
  • Beauchamp, T.L. (2011). Making Principlism Practical, Bioethics, 25(6), 301-303.
  • Beauchamp, T.L. & Childress, J.F. (1979). Principles of Biomedical Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Beauchamp, T.L. & Childress, J.F. (2009). Principles of Biomedical Ethics, 6th ed., New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Beecher, H. (1966). Ethics and Clinical Research, New England Journal of Medicine, 274(24), 1354-1360.
  • Brody, B. (1988). Life and Death Decision-Making. New York: Oxford University Press.
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  • Cole, E. & Coultrap-McQuin, S. (1992). Explorations in Feminist Ethics: Theory and Practice. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Donchin, A. (2001). Understanding Autonomy Relationally Toward a Reconfiguration of Bioethical Principles, Journal of Medicine and Philosophy, 26(4), 365-386.
  • Donchin, A. & Purdy, L. (1999). Embodying Bioethics: Recent Feminist Advances. Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield.
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  • Donovan, J. & Adams, C. (1996). Beyond Animal Rights: A Feminist Caring Ethic for the Treatment of Animals. New York: Continuum.
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  • Gudorf, C.E. (1994). A Feminist Critique of Biomedical Principlism. In: E.R. DuBose, R.P. Hamel & L.J. O’Connell (Eds.), A Matter of Principles? Ferment in US Bioethics. Valley Forge: Trinity Press International, 164-181.
  • Habermas, J. (1997). Die Herausforderung der ökologischen Ethik für eine anthropozentrisch ansetzende Konzeption. In: A. Krebs (Ed.). Naturethik: Grundtexte der gegenwärtigen tier- und ökoethischen Diskussion. Frankfurt am Main.: Suhrkamp, 92-99.
  • Haker, H. (2003). Feministische Bioethik. In: M. Düwell & K. Steigleder (Eds.), Bioethik. Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp, 168-183.
  • Harris, J. (1975). Survival Lottery, Philosophy, 50(191), 82-87.
  • Holland, S. (2011). The Virtue Ethics Approach to Bioethics, Bioethics, 25(4), 192-201.
  • Holmes, H.B. & Purdy, L.M. (1992). Feminist Perspectives in Medical Ethics, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Hursthouse, R. (1987). Beginning Lives. Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Hursthouse, R. (1991). Virtue Theory and Abortion, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 20(3), 223-246.
  • Hursthouse, R. (1999). On Virtue Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hursthouse, R. (2007). Environmental Virtue Ethics. In: R.L. Walker & P.J. Ivanhoe (Eds.), Working Virtue: Virtue Ethics and Contemporary Moral Problems. New York: Oxford University Press, 155-172.
  • Hursthouse, R. (2011). Virtue Ethics and the Treatment of Animals. In: T.L. Beauchamp & R.G. Frey (Eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Animal Ethics. New York: Oxford University Press, 119-143.
  • Jagger, A.M. (1992). Feminist Ethics. In: L. Becker (Ed.), Encyclopedia of Ethics. New York: Garland, 364-367.
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  • Jansen, L.A. (2000). The Virtues in Their Place: Virtue Ethics in Medicine, Theoretical Medicine and Bioethics, 2(21), 261-276.
  • Joint Commission for Accreditation of Healthcare Organizations (1992). Accreditation Manual For Hospitals. Oakbrook Terrace, IL: JCAHO, 106.
  • Jonas, H. (1966). The Phenomenon of Life: Toward a Philosophical Biology. New York: Harper & Row.
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b. Further Reading

  • Boylan, M. (2013). Medical Ethics, 2nd ed., Malden, MA and Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Held, V. (1995). Justice and Care: Essential Readings in Feminist Ethics. Boulder and Oxford: Westview Press.
  • Mahowald, M. (2001). Cultural Differences and Sex Selection. In: R. Tong (Ed.), Globalizing Feminist Bioethics. Crosscultural Perspectives. Boulder: Westview Press, 165-178.
  • Muller, C.F. (1990). Health Care and Gender. New York: Russel Sage Foundation.
  • Overall, C. (1987). Ethics and Human Reproduction: A Feminist Analysis. Boston: Allen & Unwin.
  • Purdy, L. (1996). Reproducing Persons. Issues in Feminist Bioethics. Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.
  • Scully, D. (1980). Men Who Control Women’s Health: The Miseducation of Obstetrician-Gynecologists. Boston: Houghton Mifflin.
  • Thomson, J. (1971). A Defense of Abortion, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 1(1), 47-66.
  • Todd, A.D. (1989). Intimate adversaries: cultural conflict between doctors and women patients. Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press.
  • Tong, R., Anderson, G. & Santos, A. (2001). Globalizing Feminist Bioethics. Crosscultural Perspectives. Boulder: Westview Press.

Author Information

John-Stewart Gordon
University of Cologne, Germany
Vytautas Magnus University, Lithuania

Philosophy of Medicine

While philosophy and medicine, beginning with the ancient Greeks, enjoyed a long history of mutually beneficial interactions, the professionalization of “philosophy of medicine” is a nineteenth century event.  One of the first academic books on the philosophy of medicine in modern terms was Elisha Bartlett’s Essay on the Philosophy of Medical Science, published in 1844.  In the mid to late twentieth century, philosophers and physicians contentiously debated whether philosophy of medicine was a separate discipline distinct from the disciplines of either philosophy or medicine.  The twenty-first century consensus, however, is that it is a distinct discipline with its own set of problems and questions. Professional journals, books series, individual monographs, as well as professional societies and meetings are all devoted to discussing and answering that set of problems and questions.  This article examines—by utilizing a traditional approach to philosophical investigation—all aspects of the philosophy of medicine and the attempts of philosophers to address its unique set of problems and questions.  To that end, the article begins with metaphysical problems and questions facing modern medicine such as reductionism vs. holism, realism vs. antirealism, causation in terms of disease etiology, and notions of disease and health.  The article then proceeds to epistemological problems and questions, especially rationalism vs. empiricism, sound medical thinking and judgments, robust medical explanations, and valid diagnostic and therapeutic knowledge.  Next, it will address the vast array of ethical problems and questions, particularly with respect to principlism and the patient-physician relationship.  The article concludes with a discussion of what constitutes the nature of medical knowledge and practice, in light of recent trends towards both evidence-based and patient-centered medicine.  Finally, even though a vibrant literature on nonwestern traditions is available, this article is concerned only with the western tradition of philosophy of medicine (Kaptchuk, 2000; Lad, 2002; Pole, 2006; Unschuld, 2010).

Table of Contents

  1. Metaphysics
    1. Reductionism vs. Holism
    2. Realism vs. Antirealism
    3. Causation
    4. Disease and Health
  2. Epistemology
    1. Rationalism vs. Empiricism
    2. Medical Thinking
    3. Explanation
    4. Diagnostic and Therapeutic Knowledge
  3. Ethics
    1. Principlism
    2. Patient-Physician Relationship
  4. What is Medicine?
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Metaphysics

Traditionally, metaphysics pertains to the analysis of objects or events and the forces or factors causing or impinging upon them.  One branch of metaphysics, denoted ontology, investigates problems and questions concerning the nature and existence of objects or events and their associated forces or factors.  For philosophy of medicine in the twenty-first century, the two chief objects are the patient’s disease and health, along with the forces or factors responsible for causing them.  “What is/causes health?” or “What is/causes disease?” are contentious questions for philosophers of medicine.  Another branch of metaphysics involves the examination of presuppositions that inform a given ontology.  For philosophy of medicine, the most controversial debate centers around the presuppositions of reductionism and holism.  Questions like “Can a disease be sufficiently reduced to its elemental components?” or “Is the patient more than simply the sum of physical parts?” drive discussion among philosophers of medicine.  In addition, the debate between realism and antirealism has important traction within the field.  This debate centers on questions like, “Are disease-causing entities real?” or “Are these entities socially constructed?”   This section first explores the reductionism-holism and realism-antirealism debates, along with the notion of causation, before turning attention to the notions of disease and health.

a. Reductionism vs. Holism

The reductionism-holism debate enjoys a lively history, especially from the middle to the latter part of the twentieth century.  Reductionism, broadly construed, is the diminution of complex objects or events to their component parts.  In other words, the properties of the whole are simply the addition or summation of the properties of the individual parts.  Such reductionism is often called metaphysical or ontological reductionism to distinguish it from methodological or epistemological reductionism.  Methodological reductionism refers to the investigation of complex objects and events and their associated forces or factors by using technology that isolates and analyzes individual components only.  Epistemological reductionism involves the explanation of complex objects and events and their associated forces or factors in terms of their individual components only.  For the life sciences vis-à-vis reductionism, an organism is made of component parts like bio-macromolecules and cells, whose properties are sufficient for investigating and explaining the organism, if not life itself.  Life scientists often sort these parts into a descending hierarchy. Beginning with the organism,  they proceed downward through organ systems, individual organs, tissues, cells, and macromolecules until reaching the atomic and subatomic levels.  Albert Szent-Gyorgyi once remarked, as he descended this hierarchy in his quest for understanding living organisms, “life slipped between his fingers.”  Holism, however, is the position that the properties of the whole are not reducible to properties of its individual components.  Jan Smuts (1926) introduced the term in the early part of the twentieth century, especially with respect to biological evolution, to account for living processes—without the need for immaterial components.

The relevance of the reductionism-holism debate pertains to both medical knowledge and practice.  Reductionism influences not only how a biomedical scientist investigates and explains disease, but also how a clinician diagnoses and treats it.  For example, if a biomedical researcher believes that the underlying cause of a mental disease is dysfunction in brain processes or mechanisms, especially at the molecular level, then that disease is often investigated exclusively at that level.  In turn, a clinician classifies mental diseases in terms of brain processes or mechanisms at the molecular level, such as depletion in levels of the neurotransmitter serotonin.  Subsequently, the disease is treated pharmacologically by prescribing drugs to elevate the low levels of the neurotransmitter in the depressed brain to levels considered normal within the non-depressed brain.  Although the assumption of reductionism produces a detailed understanding of diseases in molecular or mechanistic terms, many clinicians and patients are dissatisfied with the assumption.  Both clinicians and patients feel that the assumption excludes important information concerning the nature of the disease, as it influences both the patient’s illness and life experience.  Rather than simply treating the disease, such information is vital for treating patients with chronic cases.  In other words, patients often feel as if physicians reduce them to their disease or diseased body part  rather than on the overall illness experience.  The assumption of holism best suits the approach to medical knowledge and practice that includes the patient’s illness experience.  Rather than striving exclusively for restoration of the patient to a pre-diseased state, the clinician assists the patient in redefining what the illness means for their life.  The outcome is not a physical cure necessarily, as it is healing of wholeness from the fragmentation in the patient’s life caused by the illness.

b. Realism vs. Antirealism

Realism is the philosophical notion that observable objects and events are actual objects and events, independent of the person observing them.  In other words, since it exists outside the minds of those observing it, reality does not depend on conceptual structures or linguistic formulations..  Proponents of realism also espouse that even unobservable objects and events, like subatomic particles, exist.  Historically, realists believe that universals—abstractions of objects and events—are separate from the mind cognizing them.  For example, terms like bacteria and cell denote real objects in the natural world, which exist apart from the human minds trying to examine and understand them.  Furthermore, scientific investigations into natural objects like bacteria and cells yield true accounts of these objects.  Anti-realism, on the other hand, is the philosophical notion that observable objects and events are not actual objects and events as observed by a person but rather they are dependent upon the person observing them.  In other words, these objects and events are mind-dependent—not mind-independent.   Anti-realists deny the existence of objects and events apart from the mind cognizing them.  Human minds construct these objects and events based on social or cultural values.  Historically, anti-realists subscribe to nominalism, in which universals do not exist and predicates of particular objects do.  Finally, they question the truth of scientific accounts of the world since no mind-independent framework can be correct absolutely.  Antirealists hold that such truth is framework dependent, so when one changes the framework, truth itself changes.

The debate among realists and anti-realists has important implications for philosophers of medicine, as well as for the practice of clinical medicine.  For example, a contentious issue is whether disease entities or conditions for the expression of a disease are real or not.  Realists argue that such entities or conditions are real and exist independent of medical researchers investigating them, while anti-realists deny their reality and existence.  Take the example of depression.  According to realists, the neurotransmitter serotonin is a real entity that exists in a real brain—apart from clinical investigations or investigators.  A low level of that transmitter is a real condition for the disease’s expression.  For anti-realists, however, serotonin is a laboratory or clinical construct based on experimental or clinical conditions.  Changes in that construct lead to changes in understanding the disease.  The debate is not simply academic but has traction for the clinic.  Clinical realists believe that restoring serotonin levels cures depression.  Clinical anti-realists are less confident about restoring levels of the neurotransmitter to affect a cure.  Rather, they believe that both diagnosis and treatment of depression do not devolve into simplistic measurements of serotonin levels.  Importantly, the anti-realists do not harbor the hope that additional information is likely to remedy the clinical problems associated with serotonin replacement therapy.  The problems are ontological to their core.  The neurotransmitter is a mental construct entirely dependent on efforts to investigate and translate laboratory investigations into clinical practice.

c. Causation

Causation has a long philosophical history, beginning with the ancient Greek philosophers.  Aristotle in particular provided a robust account of causation in terms of material cause, what something is made of; formal cause, how something is made; efficient cause, forces responsible for making something; and, final cause, the purpose for or end to which something is made.  In the modern period, Francis Bacon pruned the four Aristotelian causes to material and efficient causation.  With the rise of British empiricism, especially with David Hume’s philosophical analysis of causation, causation comes under critical scrutiny.  For Hume, in particular, causation is simply the constant conjunction of object and events, with no ontological significance in terms of hooking up the cause with the effect.  According to Hume, society indoctrinates us to assume something real exists between the cause and its effect.  Although Hume’s skepticism of causal forces prevailed in his personal study, it did not prevail in the laboratory.  During the nineteenth century, with the maturation of the scientific revolution, only one cause survived for accounting for natural entities and phenomena—the material cause, which is not strictly Aristotle’s original notion of material causation.  The modern notion involves mechanisms and processes and thereby eliminates efficient causation.  The material cause became the engine driving mechanistic ontology.  During the twentieth century, after the Einsteinian and quantum revolutions, mechanistic ontology gave way to physical ontology that included forces such as gravity as causal entities.  A century later, efficient causation is the purview of philosophers, who argue endlessly about it, while scientists take physical causation as unproblematic in constructing models of natural phenomena based on cause and effect.

For philosophers of medicine, causation is an important notion for analyzing both disease etiology and therapeutic efficacy (Carter, 2003).  At the molecular level, causation operates physico-chemically to investigate and explain disease mechanisms.  In the example of depression, serotonin is a neurotransmitter that binds specific receptors within certain brain locations, which in turn causes a cascade of molecular events in maintaining mental health.  This underlying causal or physical mechanism is critical not only for understanding the disease, but also for treating it.  Medical causation also operates at other levels.  For infectious diseases, the Henle-Koch postulates are important in determining the causal relationship between an infectious microorganism and an infected host (Evans, 1993).  To secure that relationship the microorganism must be associated with every occurrence of the disease, be isolated from the infected host, be grown under in vitro conditions, and be shown to elicit the disease upon infection of a healthy host.  Finally, medical causation operates at the epidemiological or population level.  Here, Austin Bradford Hill’s nine criteria are critical for establishing a causal relationship between environmental factors and disease incidence (Hill, 1965).  For example, the relationship between cigarette smoking and lung cancer involves the strength of the association between smoking and lung cancer, as well as the consistency of that association for the biological mechanisms.  These examples establish the importance of causal mechanisms involved in disease etiology and treatment, especially for diseases with an organic basis; however, some diseases, particularly mental disorders, do not reduce to such readily apparent causality.  Instead, they represent rich areas of investigations for philosophers of medicine.

d. Disease and Health

“What is disease?” is a contentious question among philosophers of medicine.  These philosophers distinguish among four different notions of disease.  The first is an ontological notion.  According to its proponents, disease is a palpable object or entity whose existence is distinct from that of the diseased patient.  For example, disease may be the condition brought on by the infection of a microorganism, such as a virus.  Critics, who champion a physiological notion of disease, argue that advocates of the ontological notion confuse the disease condition, which is an abstract notion, with a concrete entity like a virus.  In other words, proponents of the first notion often combine the disease’s condition and cause.  Supporters of this second notion argue that disease represents a deviation from normal physiological functioning.  The best-known defender of this notion is Christopher Boorse (1987), who defines disease as a value-free statistical norm with respect to “species design.”  Critics who object to this notion, however, cite the ambiguity of the term “norm” in terms of a reference class.  Instead of a statistical norm, evolutionary biologists propose a notion of disease as a maladaptive mechanism, which factors in the organism’s biological history.  Critics of this third notion claim that disease manifests itself, especially clinically, in terms of the individual patient and not a population.  A population may be important to epidemiologists but not to clinicians who must treat individual patients whose manifestation of a disease and response to therapy for that disease may differ from each other significantly.  The final notion of disease addresses this criticism.  The genetic notion claims that disease is the mutation in or absence of a gene.  Its champions assert that each patient’s genomic constitution is unique. By knowing the genomic constitution, clinicians are able to both diagnose the patient’s disease and tailor a specific therapeutic protocol.  Critics of the genetic notion claim that disease, especially its experience, cannot be reduced to nucleotide sequences.  Instead, it requires a larger notion including social and cultural factors.

“What is health?” is an equally contentious question  among philosophers of medicine.   The most common notion of health is simply absence of disease.  Health, according to proponents of this notion, represents a default state as opposed to pathology.  In other words, if an organism is not sick then it must be healthy.  Unfortunately, this notion does not distinguish between various grades of health or preconditions towards illness.  For example, as cells responsible for serotonin stop producing the neurotransmitter a person is prone to depression.  Such a person is not as healthful as a person who is making sufficient amounts of serotonin.  An adequate understanding of health should account for such preconditions.  Moreover, health as absence of disease often depends upon personal and social values of what is health.  Again, ambiguity enters into defining health given these values.  For one person, health might be very different from that of another.  The second notion of health does permit distinction between grades of health, in terms of quantifying it, and does not depend upon personal or social values.  Proponents of this notion, such as Boorse, define health in terms of normal functioning, where the normal reflects a statistical norm with respect to species design.  For example, a person with low levels of serotonin who is not clinically symptomatic in terms of depression is not as healthful as a person with statistically normal neurotransmitter levels.  Criticisms of the second notion revolve around its lack of incorporating the social dimension of health and jettison the notion altogether opting for the notion of wellbeing.  Wellbeing is a normative notion that combines both a person’s values, especially in terms of his or her life goals, and objective physiological states.  Because normative notions contain a person’s value system, they are often difficult to define and defend since values vary from person to person and culture to culture.  Proponents of this notion include Lennart Nordenfelt (1995), Carol Ryff and Burton Singer (1998), Carolyn Whitbeck (1981).

2. Epistemology

Epistemology is the branch of philosophy concerned with the analysis of knowledge, in terms of both its origins and justification.  The overarching question is, “What is knowing or knowledge?”  Subsidiary questions include, “How do we know that we know?”; “Are we certain or confident in our knowing or knowledge?”; “What is it we know when we claim we know?” Philosophers generally distinguish three kinds or theories of knowledge.  The first pertains to knowledge by acquaintance, in which a knowing or an epistemic agent is familiar with an object or event.  It is descriptive in nature, that is, a knowing-about knowledge.  For example, a surgeon is well acquainted with the body’s anatomy before performing an operation.  The second is competence knowledge, which is the species of knowledge useful for performing a task skillfully.  It is performative or procedural in nature, that is, a knowing-how knowledge.  Again, by way of example, the surgeon must know how to perform a specific surgical procedure before executing it.  The third, which interests philosophers most, is propositional knowledge.  It pertains to certain truths or facts.  As such, philosophers traditionally call this species of knowledge, “justified true belief.”  Rather than descriptive or performative in nature, it is explanatory, or a knowing-that knowledge.  Again, by way of illustration, the surgeon must know certain facts or truths about the body’s anatomy, such as the physiological function of the heart, before performing open-heart surgery.  This section begins with the debate between rationalists and empiricists over the origins of knowledge, before turning to medical thinking and explanation and then concluding with the nature of diagnostic and therapeutic knowledge.

a. Rationalism vs. Empiricism

The rationalism-empiricism debate has a long history, beginning with the ancient Greeks, and focuses on the origins of knowledge and its justification.  “Is that origin rational or empirical in nature?”  “Is knowledge deduced or inferred from first principles or premises?”  “Or, is it the result of careful observation and experience?”  These are just a few of the questions fueling the debate, along with similar questions concerning epistemic justification.  Rationalists, such as Socrates,Plato,  Descartes, and Kant, appeal to reason as being both the origin and the justification of knowledge.  As such, knowledge is intuitive in nature, and in contrast to the senses or perception, it is exclusively the product of the mind.  Given the corruptibility of the senses, argue the rationalists, no one can guarantee or warrant knowledge—except through the mind’s capacity to reason.  In other words, rationalism provides a firm foundation not only for the origin of knowledge but also for warranting its truth.    Empiricists, such as Aristotle, Avicenna, Bacon, Locke, Hume, and Mill, avoid the fears of rationalists and exalt observation and experience with respect to the origin and justification of knowledge.  According to empiricists, the mind is a blank slate (Locke’s tabula rasa) upon which observations and experiences inscribe knowledge.  Here, empiricists champion the role of experimentation in the origin and justification of knowledge.

The rationalism-empiricism debate originates specifically with ancient Greek and Roman medicine.  The Dogmatic school of medicine, founded by Hippocrates’ son and son-in-law in the fourth century BCE, claimed that reason is sufficient for understanding the underlying causes of diseases and thereby for treating them.  Dogmatics relied on theory, especially the humoral theory of health and disease, to practice medicine.  The Empiric school of medicine, on the other hand, asserted that only observation and experience, not theory, is a sufficient foundation for medical knowledge and practice.  Theory is an outcome of medical observation and experience, not their foundation.  Empirics relied on palpable, not underlying, causes to explain health and disease and to practice medicine.  Philinus of Cos and his successor Serapion of Alexandria, both third century BCE Greek physicians, are credited with founding the Empiric school, which included the influential Alexandrian school.  A third school of medicine arose in response to the debate between the Dogmatics and Empirics, the Methodic school of medicine.  In contrast to Dogmatics, and in agreement with Empirics, Methodics argued that underlying causes are superfluous to the practice of medicine.  Rather, the patient’s immediate symptoms, along with common sense, are sufficient and provide the necessary information to treat the patient.  Thus, in contrast to Empirics, Methodics argued that experience is unnecessary to treat disease and that the disease’s symptoms provide all the knowledge needed to practice medicine.

The Dogmatism-Empiricism debate, with Methodism representing a minority position, raged on and was still lively in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries.  For example, Giorgio Baglivi (1723), an Armenian-born seventeenth century Italian physician, decried the polarization of physicians along dogmatic and empiric boundaries and recommended resolving the debate by combining the two.  Contemporary philosophical commentators on medicine recognize the importance of both epistemic positions, and several commentators propose synthesis of them.  For example, Jan van Gijn (2005) advocates an “empirical cycle” in which experiments drive hypothetical thinking, which in turn results in additional experimentation.  Although no clear resolution of the rationalism-empiricism debate in medicine appears on the immediate horizon, the debate does emphasize the importance of and the need for additional philosophical analysis of epistemic issues surrounding medical knowledge.

b. Medical Thinking

“How doctors think” is the title of two  twenty-first century books on medical thinking.  The first is by a medical humanities scholar, Kathryn Montgomery (2006).  Montgomery addresses vital questions about how physicians go about making clinical decisions when often faced with tangible uncertainty.  She argues for medical thinking based not on science but on Aristotelian phronesis, or practical or intuitive reasoning.  The second book is by a practicing clinician, Jerome Groopman (2007).  Groopman also addresses questions about medical thinking, and he too pleads for clinical reasoning based on practical or intuitive foundations.  Both books call for introducing the art of medical thinking to offset the over dependence on the science of medical thinking.  In general, medical thinking reflects the cognitive faculties of clinicians to make rational decisions about what ails patients and how best to go about treating them both safely and effectively.  That thinking, during the twentieth century, mimicked the technical thinking of natural scientists—and, for good reason.  As Paul Meehl (1954) convincingly demonstrated, statistical reasoning in the clinical setting out performs intuitive clinical thinking.  Although Montgomery’s and Groopman’s attempts to swing the pendulum back to the art of medical thinking, the risk of medical errors often associated with such thinking demands clearer analysis of the science of medical thinking.  That analysis centers traditionally on both logical and algorithmic methods of clinical judgment and decision-making, to which the twenty-first century has turned.

Georg Stahl’s De logico medica, published in 1702, is one of the first modern treatises on medical logic.  However, not until the nineteenth century did logic of medicine become an important area of sustained analysis or have an impact on medical knowledge and practice.  For example, Friedrich Oesterlen’s Medical logic, published in English translation in 1855, promoted medical logic not only as a tool for assessing the formal relationship between propositional statements and thereby avoiding clinical error, but also for analyzing the relationship among medical facts and evidence in the generation of medical knowledge.  Oesterlen’s logic of medicine was indebted to the Paris school of clinical medicine, especially Pierre Louis’ numerical method (Morabia, 1996).  Contemporary logic of medicine continues this tradition, especially in terms of statistical analysis of experimental and clinical data.  For example, Edmond Murphy’s The Logic of Medicine (1997) represents an analysis of logical and statistical methods used to evaluate both experimental and clinical evidence.  Specifically, Murphy identifies several “rules of evidence” critical for interpreting such evidence as medical knowledge.  A particularly vigorous debate concerns the role of frequentist vs. Bayesian statistics in determining the statistical significance of data from clinical trials.  The logic of medicine, then, represents an important and a fruitful discipline in which medical scientists and clinical practitioners can detect and avoid errors in the generation and substantiation of medical knowledge and in its application or translation to the clinic.

Philosophers of medicine actively debate the best courses of action for making clinical decisions.  For, clinical judgment is an informal process in which a clinician assesses a patient’s clinical signs and symptoms to come to an accurate judgment about what is ailing the patient. To make such a judgment requires an insight into the intelligibility of the clinical evidence.  The issue for philosophers of medicine is what role intuition should play in clinical judgment when facing the ideals of objective scientific reasoning and judgment.  Meehl’s work on clinical judgment, as noted earlier casted suspicion on the effectiveness of intuition in clinical judgment; and yet, some philosophers of medicine champion  the understood dimension in such decision-making.  The debate often reduces to whether clinical judgment is an art or a science; however, some, like Alvan Feinstein (1994), argue for a reconciliatory position between them.  Once a physician comes to a judgment then the physician must make a decision as to how to proceed clinically.  Although clinical decision making, with its algorithmic-like decision trees, is a formal procedure compared to clinical judgment, philosophers of medicine actively argue about the structure of these trees and procedures for generating and manipulating them.  The main issue is how best to define the utility grounding the trees.

c. Explanation

Epistemologists are generally interested in the nature of propositions especially the explanatory power of those justified true beliefs.  To know something truly is to understand and explain the hidden causes behind it.  Explanations operate at a variety of levels.  For example, neuroscientific explanations account for human behavior in terms of the neurological activity while astrological explanations account for such behavior with respect to astronomical activity.  Philosophers, especially philosophers of science, distinguish several kinds of explanations, including the covering law explanation, causal explanation, and inference to the best explanation.  In twenty-first century medicine, explanations are important for understanding disease mechanisms and, in understanding those mechanisms, for developing therapeutic modalities to treat the patient’s disease.  This line of reasoning runs deep in medical history, beginning, as we have seen, with the Dogmatics.  Twenty-first century philosophers of medicine utilize the explanatory schemes developed by philosophers of science to account for medical phenomena.  The Following section will briefly examine each of these explanatory schemes and their relevance for medical explanations.

Carl Hempel and Paul Oppenheim introduced covering law explanation in the late 1940s.  According to Hempel and Oppenheim (1948), explanations function as arguments with the conclusion or explanandum—that which is explained—deduced or induced from premises or explanans—that which does the explaining.  At least one of the explanans must be a scientific law, which can be a mechanistic or statistical law.  Although covering law explanations are useful for those medical phenomena that reduce to mechanistic or statistical laws, such as explaining cardiac output in terms of heart rate and stroke volume, not all such phenomena lend themselves to such reductive explanations.  The next explanatory scheme, causal explanation, attempts to rectify that problem.  Causal explanation relies on the temporal or spatial regularity of phenomena and events and utilizes antecedent causes to explain phenomena and events.  The explanations can be simplistic in nature, with only a few antecedent causes arranged linearly, or very complex, with multiple antecedent causes operating in a matrix of interrelated and integrated interactions.  For example, causal explanations of cancer involve at least six distinct sets of genetic factors controlling cellular phenomena such as cell growth and death, immunological response, and angiogenesis.  Finally, Gilbert Harman articulated the contemporary form of inference to the best explanation, or IBE, in the 1960s.  Harman (1965) proposed that based on the totality of evidence one must choose the explanation that best accounts for or infers that evidence and reject its competitors.  The criteria for “bestness” range from the explanation’s simplicity to its generality or consilience to account for analogous phenomena.  Peter Lipton (2004) offers Ignaz Semmelweis’ explanation of increased mortality of women giving birth in one ward compared to another, as an example of IBE.  Donald Gillies (2005) provides an analysis of it in terms of Kuhnian paradigm.

d. Diagnostic and Therapeutic Knowledge

Diagnostic knowledge pertains to the clinical judgments and decisions made about what ails a patient.  Epistemologically, the issues concerned with such knowledge are its accuracy and certainty.  Central to both these concerns are clinical symptoms and signs.  Clinical symptoms are subjective manifestations of the disease that the patient articulates during the medical interview, while clinical signs are objective manifestations that the physician discovers during the physical examine.  What is important for the clinician is how best to quantify those signs and symptoms, and then to classify them in a robust nosology or disease taxonomy.  The clinical strategy is to collect the empirical data through the physical examination and laboratory tests, to deliberate on that data, and then to draw a conclusion as to what the data means in terms of the patient’s disease condition.  The strategy is fraught with questions for philosophers of medicine, from “What constitutes symptoms and signs and how they differ?” to “How best to measure and quantify the signs and to classify the diseases?”  Philosophers of medicine debate the answers to these questions, but the discussion among philosophers of science over the strategy by which natural scientists investigate the natural world guides much of the debate.  Thus, a clinician generates hypotheses about a patient’s disease condition, which he or she then assesses by conducting further medical tests.  The result of this process is a differential diagnosis, which represents a set of hypothetical explanations for the patient’s disease condition.  The clinician then narrows this set to one diagnostic hypothesis that best explains most, and hopefully all, of the relevant clinical evidence.  The epistemic mechanism that accounts for this process and the factors involved in it are unclear.  Philosophers of medicine especially dispute the role of tacit factors in the process.  Finally, the heuristics of the process are an active area of philosophical investigation in terms of identifying rules for interpreting clinical evidence and observations.

Therapeutic knowledge refers to the procedures and modalities used to treat patients.  Epistemologically, the issues concerned with such knowledge are its efficacy and safety.  Efficacy refers to how well the pharmacological drug or surgical procedure treats or cures the disease, while safety refers to possible patient harm caused by side effects.  The questions animating discussion among philosophers of medicine range from “What is a cure?” to “How to establish or justify the efficacy of a drug or procedure?” The latter question occupies a considerable amount of the philosophy of medicine literature, especially the nature and role of clinical trials.  Although basic medical research into the etiology of disease mechanisms is important, the translation of that research and the philosophical problems that arise from it are foremost on the agenda for philosophers of medicine.  The origin of clinical trials dates at least to the eighteenth century but not until the twentieth century is consensus reached over the structure of these trials.  Today, four phases define a clinical trial.  During the first phase, clinical investigators establish the maximum tolerance of healthy volunteers to a drug.  The next phase involves a small patient population to determine the drug’s efficacy and safety.  In the third phase, which is the final phase required to obtain FDA approval, clinical investigators utilize a large and relatively diverse patient population to establish the drug’s efficacy and safety.  A fourth stage is possible in which clinical investigators chart the course of the drug’s use and effectiveness in a diverse patient population over a longer period.  The following are topics of active discussion among philosophers of medicine: The nature of clinical trials with respect to features like randomizing in which test subjects are arbitrarily assigned to either experimental or control groups, blinding of patients and physicians to randomizing to remove assessment bias, concurrent control in which the control group does not receive the experimental treatment that the test group receives, and the role of the placebo effect or the expected benefit patient’s anticipate from receiving treatment represent.  However, the most pressing problem is the type of statistics utilized for analyzing clinical trial evidence.   Some philosophers of medicine champion frequentist statistics, while others Bayesian statistics.

3. Ethics

Ethics is the branch of philosophy concerned with the right or moral conduct or behavior of a community and its members.  Traditionally, philosophers divide ethics into descriptive, normative, and applied ethics.  Descriptive ethics involves detailing ethical conduct without evaluating it in terms of moral codes of conduct, whereas normative ethics pertains to how a community and its members should act under given situations, generally in terms of an ethical code.  This code is often a product of certain values held in common within a community.  For example, ethical codes against murder reflect values community members place upon taking human life without just cause.  Besides values, ethicists base normative ethics on a particular theoretical perspective.  Within western culture, three such perspectives predominate.  The first and historically oldest ethical theory—although it experienced a Renaissance in the late twentieth century—is virtue ethics.  Virtue ethics claims that ethical conduct is the product of a moral agent who possesses certain virtues, such as prudence, courage, temperance, or justice—the traditional cardinal virtues.  The second ethical theory is deontology and bases moral conduct on adherence to ethical precepts and rules reflecting moral duties and obligations.  The third ethical theory is consequentialism, which founds moral conduct on the outcome or consequence of an action.  The chief example of this theory is utilitarianism, or the maximization of an action’s utility, which claims that an action is moral if it realizes the greatest amount of happiness for the greatest number of community members.   Finally, applied ethics is the practical use of ethics within a profession such as business or medicine.  Medical or biomedical ethics reflects applied ethics and is a major feature within the landscape of twenty-first century medicine.  Historically, ethical issues are a conspicuous component of medicine beginning with Hippocrates.  Throughout medical history several important treatises on medical ethics have been published.  Probably the best-known example is Thomas Percival’s Medical Ethics, published in 1803, which influenced the development of the American Medical Association’s ethical code.  Today, medical ethics is founded not on any particular ethical theory but on four ethical principles.

a. Principlism

The origins of the predominant system for contemporary medical or biomedical ethics began in 1932.  In that year, the Public Health Service, in conjunction with the Tuskegee Institute in Macon County, Alabama, undertook a clinical study to document the course of syphilis on untreated test subjects.  The subjects were Afro-American males.  Over the next forty years, healthcare professionals observed the course of the disease, even after the introduction of antibiotics.  Not until 1972, did the study end and only after public outcry from newspaper articles—especially an article in the New York Times—reporting the study’s atrocities.  What made the study so atrocious was that the healthcare professionals misinformed the subjects about treatment or failed to treat the subjects with antibiotics.  To insure that such flagrant abuse of test subjects did not happen again, the National Commission for the Protection of Human Subjects of Biomedical and Behavioral Research met from February 13-16, 1976.  At the Smithsonian Institute’s Belmont Conference Center in Maryland, the commission drafted guidelines for the treatment of research subjects.  The outcome was a report entitled, Ethical Principles and Guidelines for the Protection of Human Subjects of Research, or known simply as the Belmont Report, published in 1979.  The report lists and discusses several ethical principles necessary for protecting human test subjects and patients from unethical treatment at the hands of healthcare researchers and providers.  The first is respect for persons, in that researchers must respect the test subject’s autonomy to make informed decisions based on accurate and truthful information concerning the test study’s procedures and risks.  The next principle is beneficence or maximizing the benefits to risk ratio for the test subject.  The final ethical principle is justice, which ensures that the cost to benefit ratio is equitably distributed among the general population and that no one segment of it bears an unreasonable burden with respect to the ratio.

One of the framers of the Belmont Report was a young philosopher named Tom Beauchamp.  While working on the report, Beauchamp, in collaboration with a colleague, James Childress, was also writing a book on the role of ethical principles in guiding medical practice.  Rather than ground biomedical ethics on any particular ethical theory, such as deontology or utilitarianism, Beauchamp and Childress looked to ethical principles for guiding and evaluating moral decisions and judgments in healthcare.  The fruit of their collaboration was Principles of Biomedical Ethics, first published in the same year as the Belmont Report, 1979.  In the book, Beauchamp and Childress apply the ethical principles approach of the report to regulate the activities of biomedical researchers, to assist physicians in deliberating over the ethical issues associated with the practice of clinical medicine.  However, besides the three guiding principles of the report, they added a fourth—nonmaleficence.  Moreover, the first principle became patient autonomy, rather than respect of persons as denoted in the report.  For the autonomy principle, Beauchamp and Childress stress the patient’s liberty to make critical decisions concerning treatment options, which have a direct impact on the patient’s own values and life plans.  The authors’ second principle, nonmaleficence, instructs the healthcare provider to avoid doing harm to the patient, while the next principle of beneficence emphasizes removing harm and doing good to the patient.  Beauchamp and Childress articulate the final principle, justice, in terms reminiscent of the Belmont report with respect to equitable distribution of risks and benefits, as well as healthcare resources, among both the general and patient populations.  The bioethical community quickly dubbed  the Beauchamp and Childress approach to biomedical ethics as principlism.

Principlism’s impact on the bioethical discipline is unparalleled.  Beauchamp and Childress’ book is now in its fifth edition and is a standard textbook for teaching biomedical ethics at medical schools and graduate programs in medical ethics.  One of the chief advocates of principlism is Raanan Gillon (1986)  Gillon expanded the scope of the principles to aid in their application to difficult bioethical issues, especially where the principles might conflict with one another.  However, principlism is not without its critics.  A fundamental complaint is the lack of theoretical support for the four principles, especially when the principles collide with one another in terms of their application to a bioethical problem. In its use, ethicists and clinicians generally apply the principles in an algorithmic manner to justify practically any ethical position on a biomedical problem.  What critics want is a unified theoretical basis for grounding the principles, in order to avoid or adjudicate conflicts among the principles.  Moreover, Beauchamp and Childress’ emphasis on patient autonomy had serious ramifications on the physician’s role in medical care, with that role at times marginalized to the patient’s role.  Alfred Tauber (2005), for instance, charges that such autonomy itself is “sick” and often results in patients abandoned to their own resources with detrimental outcomes for them.  In response to their critics, Beauchamp and Childress argue that no single ethical theory is available to unite the four principles to avoid or adjudicate conflicts among them.  However, they did introduce in the fourth edition of Principles, a notion of common morality—a set of shared moral standards—to provide theoretical support for the principles.  Unfortunately, their notion of common morality lacks the necessary theoretical robustness to unify the principles effectively.  Although principlism still serves a useful function in biomedical ethics, particularly in the clinic, early twenty-first century trends towards healthcare ethics and global bioethics have made its future unclear.

b. Patient-Physician Relationship

According to many philosophers of medicine, medicine is more than simply a natural or social science; it is a moral enterprise.  What makes medicine moral is the patient-physician or therapeutic relationship.  Although some philosophers of medicine criticize efforts to model the relationship, given the sheer number of contemporary models proposed to account for it, modeling the relationship has important ramifications for understanding and framing the moral demands of medicine and healthcare.  The traditional medical model within the industrialized West, especially in mid twentieth century America, was paternalism or “doctor knows best.”  The paternalistic model is doctor-centered in terms of power distribution, with the patient representing a passive agent who simply follows the doctor’s orders.  The patient is not to question those orders, unless to clarify them.  The source for this power distribution is the doctor’s extensive medical education and training relative to the patient’s lack of medical knowledge.  In this model, the doctor represents a parent, generally a father figure and the patient a child—especially a sick child.  The motivation of this model is to relieve a patient burdened with suffering from a disease, to benefit the patient from the doctor’s medical knowledge, and to affect a cure while returning the patient to health.  In other words, the model’s guiding principle is beneficence.  Besides the paternalistic model, other doctor-centered models include the priestly and mechanic models.  However, the paternalistic model, as well as the other doctor-centered models, ran into severe criticism with abuses associated with the models and with the rise of patient advocacy groups to correct the abuses.

Within the latter part of the twentieth century and the rise of patient autonomy as a guiding principle for medical practice, alternative patient-physician models challenged traditional medical paternalism.  Instead of doctor-centered, one set of models are patient-centered in which patients are the locus of power.  The most predominant patient-centered model is the business model, where the physician is a healthcare provider and the patient a consumer of healthcare goods and services.  The business model is an exchange relationship and relies heavily on a free market system.  Thus, the patient possesses the power to pick and choose among physicians until a suitable healthcare provider is found.  The legal model is another patient-centered model, in which the patient is a client and the guiding forces are patient autonomy and justice.  Patient and physician enter into a contract for healthcare services.  Another set of models in which patients have significant power in the therapeutic relationship are the mutual models.  In these models, neither patients nor physicians have the upper hand in terms of power-they share it.  The most predominant model is the partnership model in which patient and physician are associates in the therapeutic relationship.  The guiding force of this model is informed consent in which the physician apprises the patient of the available therapeutic options and the patient then chooses which is best.  Both the patient and physician share decision making over the best means for affecting a cure.  Finally, other examples of mutual models include the covenant model, which stresses promise instead of contract; the friendship model, which involves a familial-like relationship; and, the neighbor model, which maintains a “safe” distance and yet familiarity between patient and physician.

4. What is Medicine?

The nature of medicine is certainly an important question facing twenty-first century philosophers of medicine.  One reason for its importance is that the question addresses the vital topic of how physicians should practice medicine.  During the turn of the twenty-first century, clinicians and other medical pundits have begun to accept evidence-based medicine, or EBM, as the best way to practice medicine.  Proponents of EBM claim that physicians should engage in medical practices based on the best scientific and clinical evidence available, especially from randomized controlled clinical trials, systematic observations, and meta-analyses of that evidence, rather than on pathophysiology or an individual physician’s clinical experience. Proponents also claim that EBM represents a paradigmatic shift away from traditional medicine.  Traditional practitioners doubt the radical claims of EBM proponents.  One specific objection is that application of evidence from population based clinical trials to the individual patient within the clinic is not as easy to accomplish as EBM proponents realize.  In response, some clinicians propose patient-centered medicine (PCM).   Patient-centered advocates include the patient’s personal information in order to apply the best available scientific and clinical evidence in treatment.  The focus then shifts from the patience’s disease to the patience’s illness experience.  The key for the practice of patient-centered medicine is a physician’s effective communication with the patient.  While some commentators present EBM and PCM as competitors, others propose a combination or integration of the two medicines.  The debate between advocates of EBM and PCM is reminiscent of an earlier debate between the science and art of medicine and belies a deep anxiety over the nature of medicine.  Certainly, philosophers of medicine can play a strategic role in the debate and assist towards its satisfactory resolution.

Besides its nature,  twenty-first century medicine also faces a number of crises, including economic, malpractice, healthcare insurance, healthcare policy, professionalism, public or global health, quality-of-care, primary or general care, and critical care—to name a few (Daschle, 2008; Relman, 2007).  Philosophers of medicine can certainly contribute to the resolution of these crises by carefully and insightfully analyzing the issues associated with them.  For example, considerable attention has been paid in the literature to the crisis over the nature of medical professionalism (Project of the ABIM Foundation, et al., 2002; Tallis, 2006).  The question that fuels this crisis is what type of physician best meets the patient’s healthcare needs and satisfies medicine’s social contract.  The answer to this question involves the physician’s professional demeanor or character.  However, little consensus as to how best to define professionalism is palpable in the literature.  Philosophers of medicine can aid by furnishing guidance towards a consensus on the nature of medical professionalism.

Philosophy of medicine is a vibrant field of exploration into the world of medicine in particular, and of healthcare in general.  Along traditional lines of metaphysics, epistemology, and ethics, a cadre of questions and problems face philosophers of medicine and cry out for attention and resolution.  In addition, many competing forces are vying for the soul of medicine today.  Philosophy of medicine is an important resource for reflecting on those forces in order to forge a medicine that meets both physical and existence needs of patients and society.

5. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

James A. Marcum
Baylor University
U. S. A.

Surrogate Parenting

Surrogate parenting is an arrangement in which one or more persons, typically a married infertile couple (the intended rearing parents), contract with a woman to gestate a child for them and then to relinquish it to them after birth. Surrogate parenting is also sometimes referred to as “contract pregnancy,” in part, so as not to beg the question about who is the child’s real mother, but also to refer to the non-nuclear-familial nature of the arrangement.  That is, this is a mode of parenting which allows a couple to have a child by involving a third party to their relationship who serves as birth mother, whether there is a contract or not. As will become apparent, surrogate parenting complicates the parenting terrain and, as such, raises significant philosophical and ethical issues. This article briefly examines some of the principal differences between commercial and non-commercial forms of surrogate/contract parenting arrangements, including the presentation of arguments against and for the moral appropriateness of this sort of parenting arrangement. After raising some of the principal challenges, four legal remedies for this complex mode of parenting are considered. This is followed by a brief summary of some healthcare organizations’ and professionals’ attitudes toward surrogacy/contract parenting arrangements. The article concludes with an assessment of the current availability and accessibility of surrogacy services and some observations about the future of surrogacy/contract parenting arrangements.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Traditional Surrogacy versus Gestational Surrogacy
  3. Commercial Surrogacy vs. Noncommercial Surrogacy
  4. Moral Arguments against Surrogacy vs. Moral Arguments for Surrogacy
  5. Legal Remedies for Surrogacy Arrangements
    1. Banning
    2. Endorsement
    3. Assimilation
    4. Hands-off
  6. Healthcare Organizations’ and Professionals’ Attitudes toward Surrogacy Arrangements
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

Based on available statistics, which are quite incomplete due to a lack of reporting regulations, about 1,500 to 2,000 surrogate/contracted babies are born per annum in the United States (Ali and Kelley 2008, 44). In addition, several thousands more are born each year as the result of a surrogate arrangement in a wide-variety of nations worldwide. Australia, Canada, and Brazil report numbers at least as large as those reported in the United States (Covington and Burns 2006, 371); and in India, where commercial surrogacy was legalized in 1992, poor women are recruited to gestate what may amount to hundreds (more likely thousands) of babies for couples throughout the world (Gentleman 2008, A9).

Although surrogate parenting arrangements are spreading across the globe, such arrangements apparently remain the exception rather than the rule. Most people prefer not to involve third parties in their attempts to procreate, and most people cannot afford to finance expensive third-party pregnancies. Still, the existence and use of surrogacy arrangements lead society to raise substantial questions about the nature of parenthood. What makes a parent the real parent of a child? The fact that she or he is genetically related to the child? The fact that she or he rears the child? Or the fact that she gestates the child (at present, gestation is an exclusively female task)? Is surrogate parenting just one of a series of steps towards what some term “collaborative reproduction”? In the future, will an increasing number of people form families that consist of an egg and/or sperm donor(s), a gestational mother, and one or more men and women who collaboratively produce and rear a child to adulthood? Or will most people continue to form the kind of nuclear, biologically-based families that exist today?

2. Traditional Surrogacy versus Gestational Surrogacy

There are two basic types of surrogate parenting: traditional surrogacy and gestational surrogacy. In traditional surrogacy, the surrogate is inseminated with the sperm of the man who intends to be the child’s rearing parent. Because the surrogate is both the genetic mother and the gestational mother of the child, she must legally terminate her parental rights to the child after its birth, at which point the intended female rearing parent may adopt the child as her stepchild. The intended male rearing parent does not need to adopt the child because he is the child’s genetic father.

The situation is quite different in a gestational surrogacy arrangement where both of the intended rearing parents may have a genetic connection to the child. The intended rearing mother’s eggs are fertilized with the intended rearing father’s sperm in vitro (outside the womb). The resulting embryo(s) are then implanted in the surrogate’s womb. The surrogate’s only connection to the child is gestational. In a variation on this arrangement, the intended rearing parents provide the surrogate with an embryo(s) to gestate for them. If the intended rearing parents are also the child’s genetic parents, they are not required to adopt the child. However, if one or both of the intended rearing parents do not have a genetic connection to the child, they may be required to adopt the child. For example, if a couple adopt surplus frozen embryos from an assisted reproduction clinic, they may be required to adopt any child(ren) that result from the embryo(s)’ gestation in a surrogate.

Infertile, heterosexual couples are the group most likely to contract a surrogate mother. However, single people, lesbian couples, gay couples, and even fertile people may also seek the services of a contracted mother. Collaborative reproductive and/or parenting arrangements have a long history throughout the world. For example, in the Judeo-Christian tradition, the Old Testament octogenarian couple, Abraham and Sarah, used a surrogate mother to carry a child to term for them. Much later, throughout the European continent and England, middle- and upper-class women used wet nurses to nurture their infant children. Moreover, in polygamous families, two or more wives of one husband collaboratively raise all of his children. Thus, it should not surprise us that people are increasingly entering into formal surrogacy/contract parenting arrangements.

3. Commercial Surrogacy vs. Noncommercial Surrogacy

Of particular significance in any discussion of surrogate parent arrangements is the fact that some of them are commercial while others are noncommercial. Commercial surrogate parenting arrangements involve monetary payments both to the surrogate and to other third parties. Depending on state laws regulating commercial surrogacy, the cost of such arrangements in the early 21st Century ranged anywhere from $20,000 to as high as $150,000 in the United States. Surrogates typically received about $20,000 with the rest of the costs being paid out to healthcare professionals, counselors, screeners, lawyers, and surrogate brokers. In an effort to hold their costs down, some intended parents have engaged in reproductive tourism, traveling to developing nations, where the total cost for a surrogate parenting arrangement ranges from $5,000 to $12,000 largely because women are willing to rent their wombs for a relatively low sum of money.

In contrast to commercial surrogacy, non-commercial surrogacy involves an arrangement where the intended rearing parents use the services of a family member or a friend. The surrogate’s compensation supposedly consists in the satisfaction she derives from giving the gift of a new human life to people for whom she personally cares. Typically, the surrogate does not expect or want monetary compensation for her gestational services. At the most, she will accept funds to cover costs such as physician’s bills.

4. Moral Arguments against Surrogacy vs. Moral Arguments for Surrogacy

As noted above, the number of surrogate babies born annually in the United States or elsewhere is relatively small. In large measure, it is probably failed, highly-publicized surrogate parenting arrangements such as the notorious Baby M case that continue to put a damper on intended rearing parents using surrogate parenting arrangements. In the 1980s New Jersey Baby M case, Mary Beth Whitehead contracted with William Stern to be artificially inseminated with his sperm, to get pregnant (if possible), to carry the child to term, and then to relinquish the child to Stern. Whitehead and Stern also agreed that Whitehead would receive $10,000 for a healthy child, but only $1,000 for a miscarried or still-born child. In addition, Whitehead agreed not to engage in sexual relations with her husband until she was pregnant; to abstain from harmful substances during the pregnancy; to undergo amniocentesis; and to submit to abortion if Stern so requested. Finally, Whitehead agreed that, upon the child’s birth, she would terminate her maternal rights so that Stern’s wife could adopt the baby.

Whitehead became pregnant and gave birth to a baby girl. But she did not relinquish the baby to Stern. Feeling very attached to the baby, Whitehead refused to abide by the terms of the contract. At first, lawyer Noel Keane, who had brokered the surrogacy arrangement, did not take Whitehead that seriously. He managed to persuade Whitehead to give the baby to the Sterns for an overnight stay. But when Whitehead became extremely upset the next day, the Sterns gave the baby back to her. They thought that within a short time, the $10,000 fee would start looking better to Whitehead than the responsibility of adding another child to her existing two-child family. The Sterns’ speculation turned out to be false. Whitehead soon told the Sterns she had reached a final decision and would never relinquish the child to them. Money was not nearly as important to her as love for the baby. At one point, the entire Whitehead family fled to Florida with the baby to escape the arm of the law, but the New Jersey police tracked the Whiteheads down and seized the baby. By then the Sterns had persuaded Judge Harvey Sorkow to grant them sole custody of the baby.

After a prolonged custody battle between Whitehead and Stern, presided over by none other than Judge Sorkow, the court determined it was in the best interests of “Baby M” to enforce the surrogacy contract. Judge Sorkow thought that Whitehead was unfit parent material because of her emotional instability and the fact that she had entered into the arrangement at all. Stern was given custody of the baby, Whitehead was stripped of her parental rights, and Stern’s wife was permitted to adopt the baby. Whitehead appealed the court’s decision and, after another protracted legal battle, the New Jersey Supreme Court overturned Sorkow’s decision, invalidating commercial surrogacy contracts as a disguised form of baby-selling. As the immediate consequence of its decision, the New Jersey Supreme Court voided the termination of Whitehead’s parental rights and invalidated Mrs. Stern’s adoption of the baby. However, the high court allowed the Sterns to keep the baby with the proviso that Whitehead be given visitation rights. The high court reasoned it was in the best interests of the two-year-old child to remain in the home of the only family she had ever known: the Sterns. Although many people thought this decision was fair, others complained it was an instance where privileged people, the Sterns, were presumed by virtue of their wealth and status to be better parents than poor, working-class people like the Whiteheads.

Cases like the Baby M case have prompted opponents of commercial surrogacy to emphasize that such parenting arrangements tend to exploit poor, young, single, or ethnic/minority women desperate for money, and that some surrogacy agencies instruct surrogates to view themselves as mere incubators for intended rearing parent(s)’ babies. In addition, some opponents of surrogacy object to non-commercial surrogacy for at least two reasons. First, a female family member may be pressured to demonstrate love for another female family member, for example, by serving as a surrogate mother for her. Second, a child may be deeply troubled upon discovering that not the mother who is raising her but actually her aunt is her gestational and perhaps also genetic mother. Finally, yet other opponents of surrogacy object that surrogacy arrangements risk the commoditization of babies as goods or products that can be contracted for as if they were mere things rather than human persons.

Advocates of surrogate parenting accuse its opponents of distorting empirical facts to rationalize their discomfort about breaking the formerly seamless web between genetic, gestational, and rearing forms of parentage. Although those who favor surrogacy concede that intended rearing parents are typically more affluent than most of the surrogates they hire, they deny that intended rearing parents routinely exploit surrogates. They note that, truth be told, most surrogates are white, between 20 and 30 years old, working class (not underclass), and married. Moreover, most surrogacy agencies prefer to use surrogates who have had at least one child and are altruistically as well as financially motivated to work as surrogates. Advocates of surrogate parenting also stress that when intended rearing parents and surrogates have and maintain good relationships with each other, no harm befalls the very-much wanted child. If anything, such a child generally finds him or herself in a particularly loving family. Finally, they claim that in a society that increasingly favors open adoptions and celebrates blended families, surrogate parenting is just another way for people to establish a family.

5. Legal Remedies for Surrogacy Arrangements

In the United Sates, four legal remedies (each with varying permutations) have been proposed at the state level to regulate surrogate parenting. They are: (1) banning commercial surrogate parenting arrangements; (2) legally enforcing most commercial and even non-commercial surrogate parenting arrangements; (3) assimilating most surrogate parenting arrangements into either traditional or modified adoption law; and (4) refusing to legally enforce any surrogate parenting arrangement whatsoever. Each of these remedies has its strengths and weaknesses, and none of them is the clear winner in attempts to properly regulate surrogate parenting arrangements.

a. Banning

A relatively small number of states ban commercial surrogacy, imposing civil and criminal penalties on surrogacy brokers in particular. Michigan is probably the most anti-surrogacy state in the Union. In 1993, Michigan legislators ruled it is a misdemeanor to be party to a surrogacy contract and a felony to serve as a “surrogate broker,” with a maximum penalty of a $50,000 fine and five years in prison (MICH. COMP. LAWS, 1993). Even though states like Michigan typically do not prohibit non-commercial surrogate parenting arrangements, they do refuse to enforce them as binding contracts. States that ban commercial surrogacy do so on the grounds that it is a disguised form of baby-selling that exploits women and commodifies children. They dismiss arguments that the intended rearing parents do not actually pay for the baby, but only for the surrogate’s gestational services. Such states also dismiss arguments that most women who serve as surrogates do so freely, and that the children to which they give birth are not viewed as merchandise but as very much wanted children. Whether outright bans of commercial surrogate parenting arrangements are constitutionally permissible remains an open question, however. Advocates of these arrangements argue that if the only way a married infertile couple, for example, can have child genetically-related to them is to use a surrogate mother service, then prohibiting them from doing so is probably a violation of their fundamental right to procreate.

b. Endorsement

An increasing number of states use codified law to recognize and enforce properly negotiated surrogate parenting contracts. One state, California, uses case law to enforce parenting contracts. Importantly, these states regulate the terms of the surrogacy contract. For example, in most states, intended rearing parents are not permitted to pay for more than the surrogate’s medical and ancillary expenses; and, in all states, intended rearing parents may not interfere with a surrogate’s abortion rights. Interestingly, most states that enforce surrogacy contracts are maximally supportive of intended rearing parents who are also the genetic parents of the child. These states reason that the intended rearing parents have two parental claims—one based on the intent to rear the child and the other based on genetics—which in combination trump any parental claim a surrogate might make solely on the basis of her gestational relationship to the child. In instances of gestational surrogacy where the intended rearing parents supply the surrogate with an embryo that is genetically unrelated to them, codified law and case law rely solely on the intended rearing parents’ intent to establish legal parenthood. Moreover, in some states where intent is recognized as the factor which establishes parenthood, the intended rearing parents may apply for an order, prior to the baby’s birth, directing that their names rather than the names of the surrogate and her husband (if she has one) be entered on the birth certificate.

c. Assimilation

Some states that recognize surrogate parenting arrangements maintain features of adoption law in their codified-law and case-law frameworks. Typically, these states provide the surrogate with a change-of-heart period, usually around 72 hours, during which she may decide not to revoke her parental rights to the child. In the estimation of some legal theorists, intent alone does not necessarily determine rightful parenthood. They believe that the “sweat equity” of gestation should count as establishing some sort of parental claim to a child.

d. Hands-off

Nearly half of the states do not view surrogate parenting arrangements as legally enforceable. Deeming a contract for a mother unenforceable means that, if either the surrogate mother or the intended rearing parents breach the contract, the state will not intervene. The parties to the contract will need to work out their differences in custody court. So, for example, if the intended rearing parents fail to pay the surrogate mother her fee, the state will not help her collect it. Or if the intended rearing parents refuse to take the child from the surrogate mother because they no longer want the child, the state will not force them to become rearing parents. Instead, the state will require the surrogate mother either to maintain her parental relationship with the child or to put the child up for adoption. In the former case, she may be entitled to child support from the genetic or intended rearing father.

As it so happens, a non-enforcement situation is just as risky for the intended rearing parents as it is for the surrogate. If the surrogate mother refuses to relinquish the child to the intended parents, they will not be able to secure custody of the child based solely on the contract they made with the surrogate mother. However, because of the state’s interest in the well-being of the child, a family-law court will rely on the traditional “best interests of the child” standard to resolve custody disputes between the surrogate and the intended rearing parents. In cases of traditional surrogacy, virtually all family law courts will view the custody dispute as one between two genetic parents: the surrogate mother and the intended father. In cases of gestational surrogacy, some family-law courts will view the custody dispute as a conflict between the gestational mother (the surrogate mother) and the genetic mother (most typically the intended mother but in some instances an egg donor) to be decided by appeal to the original intention of the involved parties.

6. Healthcare Organizations’ and Professionals’ Attitudes toward Surrogacy Arrangements

Largely because the legal remedies for surrogacy arrangements in many states are either non-existent or ambiguous, healthcare leaders have been cautious about either total bans of or wholesale endorsements of surrogate parenting. The two main medical societies that set the gold standards for assisted-reproduction accept with some reservations surrogate parenting arrangements. The American College of Obstetrics and Gynecology (ACOG) accepts surrogacy arrangements only when they are medically necessary, and the compensation to the surrogate or gestational mother is based on her services and not on her ability to produce a child for the intended rearing parents. Adopting the assimilationist view described above, ACOG also suggests that private nonprofit agencies, similar to adoption agencies, oversee surrogacy arrangements (ACOG 1990, 133), and that subsequent to the birth of the child, the surrogate or gestational mother be given a short period of time during which she can change her mind about giving up the child.

The other main assisted-reproduction medical society, the American Society for Reproductive Medicine (ASRM), recommends that intended rearing parents avoid a traditional surrogacy arrangement and instead use a gestational surrogacy arrangement. Although the ASRM is not enthusiastic about any widespread use of surrogate mothers, it recognizes surrogacy arrangements as a way for a limited number of people to exercise their procreative freedom. Like ACOG, the ASRM frowns on assisting surrogacy arrangements unless there is a medical reason to do so.

7. Conclusion

Because the assisted-reproduction industry is regulated primarily by non-enforceable practice guidelines, assisted reproduction centers and infertility clinics usually decide their own policies and procedures for surrogacy arrangements. Some centers and clinics limit their services to infertile married couples, whereas other centers and clinics welcome anyone who can pay for their services. Limiting one’s practice to certain groups of people is sometimes a covert form of discrimination against other groups of people, however. It may be morally and legally justifiable for a center or clinic to refuse to assist people who do not have a medical reason, specifically infertility, to contract a surrogate mother. After all, physicians and nurses have no clear obligation to use their skills and/or connections to serve people who do not suffer from a disease, disability, or medical abnormality. However, when physicians and nurses refuse to help gay or lesbian individuals or couples who need to enter into a surrogacy arrangement in order to have a child, their refusal to extend help to these individuals or couples may constitute an act of discrimination.

As surrogate/contract parenting arrangements are normalized and routinized, the U.S. public will probably press federal and state authorities to pass clear legislation governing surrogacy. People in the United States view their procreative rights as sacrosanct: too important to be left to the unpredictable rulings of courts and/or the sometimes arbitrary policies of infertility clinics and assisted reproduction centers. Developing ideal laws to govern surrogate parenting arrangements will be no easy matter, however, not when a gay man can use donor sperm and donor eggs to produce embryos that are then implanted in the womb of a gestational mother. Should the law, on the basis of this gay man’s intentions alone, deem him the legal father of the child? Perhaps so, despite the fact that it will be quite some time before the majority of the U.S. population and the feminist community is comfortable with such a novel surrogate parenting arrangement.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Ali, Lorraine and Raina Kelley. “The Curious Lives of Surrogates.” Newsweek, April 7, 2008, vol. 151, Issue 14, pp. 44-51.
  • American College of Obstetricians and Gynecologists. “Ethical Issues in Surrogate Motherhood.” (ACOG Committee Opinion 88). Washington, DC: ACOG, 1990.
  • Andrews, Lori B. “The Aftermath of Baby M: Proposed Laws on Surrogate Motherhood.” In Richard T. Hull (ed.). Ethical Issues in the New Reproductive Technologies. Belmont: Wadsworth, 1990.
  • Andrews, Lori B. “Alternative Modes of Reproduction.” In Sherrill Cohen and Nadine Taub (eds.). Reproductive Laws for the 1990s. Clifton, NJ: Humana Press, 1988, pp. 361-403.
  • Andrews, Lori B. “Beyond Doctrinal Boundaries: A Legal Framework for Surrogate Motherhood.” Virginia Law Review, November 1995, 81, 2343.
  • Annas, George J. “Death without Dignity for Commercial Surrogacy: The Case of Baby M.” Hastings Center Report, 1988, vol. 18, no. 2, pp. 23-24.
  • ASRM. Third Party Reproduction (Sperm, Egg, and Embryo Donation and Surrogacy. American Society for Reproductive Medicine: Birmingham, Alabama, 2006.
  • Bayles, Michael D. “Genetic Choice.” In Richard T. Hull (ed.). Ethical Issues in the New Reproductive Technologies. Belmont: Wadsworth, 1990, pp. 241-253.
  • Binion, Gayle. “Baby M, Surrogate Parenting and Public Policy.” Policy Studies Review, Spring, 1992, vol. 11, Issue 1, pp. 126-140.
  • Capron, Alexander, and M.S. Radin. “Choosing Family Law over Contract Law as a Paradigm for Surrogate Motherhood.” Law, Medicine, and Health Care, 1988, vol. 16, no. 2, p. 3a.
  • Chesler, Phyllis. The Sacred Bond: The Legacy of Baby M. New York: Times Books, 1988.
  • Covington, Sharon N. and Linda Hammer Burns. Infertility Counseling: A Comprehensive Handbook for Clinicians. Cambridge University Press: Cambridge, 2006.
  • Daar, Judith F. “Assisted Reproductive Technologies and the Pregnancy Process: Developing and Equality Model to Protect Reproductive Liberties.” American Journal of Law and Medicine, vol. 25, no. 4, 1988, pp. 453-478.
  • Davis, Peggy C. “Alternative Modes of Reproduction: Determinants of Choice.” In Sherrill Cohen and Nadine Taub (eds.). Reproductive Laws for the 1990s. Clifton, NJ: Humana Press, 1988, pp. 421-431.
  • Ethics Committee of the American Fertility Society. “Ethical Considerations of Assisted Reproductive Technologies.” Fertility and Sterility, vol. 62, no. 5, Suppl.1, November 1994, pp. 15-125S.
  • Gentleman, Amelia. “India Nurtures Business of Surrogate Motherhood.” New York Times, March 10, 2008, A9.
  • Hull, Richard T. (ed.). Ethical Issues in the New Reproductive Technologies. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 1990.
  • In re Baby M (1988), 537 A.2d 1227, N.J.
  • Jaggar, Alison M. “Feminist Ethics.” In Lawrence Becker with Caroline Becker (eds.). Encyclopedia of Ethics. New York: Garland Press, 1993, pp. 361-370.
  • Johnson v. Calvert, 851 P. 2d., 776 (Cal. 1993), cert. denied, 1145. Ct. 206 (1993), and cert. dismissed, 114 S. Ct. 374 (1993).
  • Kass, Leon. “Making Babies Revisited.” In John Arras and Robert Hunt (eds.). Ethical Issues in Modern Medicine. Palo Alto, CA: Mayfield, 1983, pp. 407-413.
  • Ketchum, Sara Ann. “New Reproductive Technologies and the Definition of Parenthood: A Feminist Perspective.” Paper presented at Feminism and Legal Theory: Women and Intimacy, a conference sponsored by the Institute for Legal Studies at the University of Wisconsin-Madison.
  • Krimmel, Herbert T. “The Case against Surrogate Parenting.” The Hastings Center Report. October, 1983, vol. 13, no. 5, pp. 35-39.
  • Mich. Comp. Laws Ann. 722.855 (West 1993).
  • O’Brien, Mary. The Politics of Reproduction. Boston: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1981.
  • Overall, Christine. Ethics and Human Reproduction: A Feminist Analysis. Boston: Allen and Unwin, 1987.
  • Rich, Adrienne. Of Woman Born. New York: Norton, 1979.
  • Robertson, John A. “Surrogate Mothers: Not So Novel after All.” The Hastings Center Report, vol. 13, no. 5, October 1983, pp. 28-34.
  • Robertson, John A. “Assisted Reproductive Technology and the Family.” Hastings Law Journal, vol. 47, no. 4, April 1996, pp. 911-933.
  • Rothman, Barbara Katz. Recreating Motherhood Ideology and Technology in a Patriarchal Society. New York: W. W. Norton and Co., 1989.
  • Schultz, Marjorie Maguire. “Reproductive Technology and Intention-based Parenthood: An Opportunity for Gender Neutrality.” Wisconsin Law Review, 1990, vol. 2, pp. 377-378.
  • Shannon, Thomas A. and Lisa S. Cahill. Religion and Artificial Reproduction: An Inquiry into the Vatican ‘Instruction on Respect for Human Life’. New York: Crossroad, 1988.
  • Singer, Peter and Deane Wells. Making Babies: The New Science and Ethics of Conception. New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1984.
  • Spallone, Patricia and Deborah Lynn Steinberg. Made to Order: The Myth of Reproductive and Genetic Progee. Oxford: Pergamon Press, 1987.
  • Surrogacy Arrangements Act, 1985, United Kingdom, Chapter 49, p. 2. (1) (a) (b) (c).
  • United States Congress, Office of Technology Assessment. Infertility: Medical and Social Choices. Washington, DC: US Government Printing Office, 1988, OTA-BA-358.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Andrews, Lori B. Between Strangers: Surrogate Mothers, Expectant Fathers, & Brave New World Babies (New York: Harper & Row, 1989).
    • Andrews’ well-balanced and accessible examination of surrogate parenting arrangements provides many case studies, statistics, and detailed policies for readers to ponder.
  • Chesler, Phyllis. Sacred Bond: The Legacy of Baby M (New York Times Books, 1988).
    • Chesler analyzes every aspect of the Baby M case and provides a deep examination of the factors that truly make for good parents.
  • Corea, Gena. The Mother Machine: Reproductive Technologies from Artificial Insemination to Artificial Wombs (New York: Harper & Row, 1985).
    • Corea’s classic radical feminist case against all forms of assisted reproduction is accessible and spirited. Although her claims are sometimes exaggerated, she does prompt readers to consider some of the harmful consequences that might result from breaking the links between genetic, gestational, and rearing parentage.
  • Overall, Christine. Reproduction: Principles, Practices, Policies (Toronto: Oxford University Press, 1993).
    • Overall’s discussion of assisted reproduction and surrogate parenting is an excellent contribution to the literature. Its style is that of the probing philosopher with more questions than answers.
  • Robertson, John. Children of Choice: Freedom and the New Reproductive Technologies (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1994).
    • Robertson provides the best case for a nearly absolute right to procreative liberty. Strong arguments for state enforcement of properly-framed surrogate parenting arrangements can be found in his very comprehensive survey of laws governing assisted reproduction in the United States.
  • Blythe, Eric and Ruth Landau. Third Party Assisted Conception across Cultures: Social, Legal, and Ethical Perspectives (London: Jessica Kingsley Publishers, 2004).
    • Blythe and Landau provide a survey of assisted reproductive technologies throughout the world. They help readers understand why some cultures accept and others reject surrogate parenting arrangements.
  • Markens, Susan. Surrogate Motherhood and the Politics of Reproduction (Berkeley: University of California Press, 2007). Markens compares and contrasts California’s and New York’s statutes involving surrogate contracts.
    • She explores how voices on all sides of reproductive technology at times converge with regards to creating surrogate policy.
  • Shevory, Thomas C. Body/Politics: Studies in Reproduction, Production, and (Re)Construction (Westport, CT: Praeger Publishers, 2000).
    • Shevory devotes a chapter of his book to a discussion of the complex nature of surrogacy contracts.

Author Information

Rosemarie Tong
University of North Carolina, Charlotte
U. S. A.


In biology, the activity of cloning creates a copy of some biological entity such as a gene, a cell, or perhaps an entire organism. This article discusses the biological, historical, and moral aspects of cloning mammals. The main area of concentration is the moral dimensions of reproductive cloning, specifically the use of cloning in order to procreate.

The article summarizes the different types of cloning, such as recombinant DNA/molecular cloning, therapeutic cloning, and reproductive cloning. It explores some classic stereotypes of human clones, and it illustrates how many of these stereotypes can be traced back to media portrayals about human cloning. After a brief history of the development of cloning technology, the article considers arguments for and against reproductive cloning.

One of the most predominate themes underlying arguments for reproductive cloning is an appeal to procreative liberty. Because cloning may provide the only way for some individuals to have a child that is genetically their own, a ban on cloning interferes with their reproductive autonomy.

Arguments against cloning appeal to concerns about a clone’s lack of genetic uniqueness and what may be implied because of this. Human cloning is of special interest. There are concerns that cloned humans would lack individuality, that they would be treated in undignified ways by their creators, or that they would be damaged by society’s expectations that they should be more like those from whom they were cloned. Because they would essentially be facsimiles of the original person, there is concern that the clones might possess less moral worth. The predominate theme underlying arguments against human cloning is that the cloned child would undergo some sort of physical, social, mental, or emotional harm. Because of these and other concerns, the United Nations and many countries have banned human cloning. An important philosophical issue is whether such a response against human cloning is warranted.

Table of Contents

  1. Types of Cloning
    1. Recombinant DNA Technology / Molecular Cloning
    2. Therapeutic Cloning
    3. Reproductive Cloning
  2. Misconceptions About Cloning and Their Sources
  3. Cloning Mammals: A Brief History
  4. Arguments in Favor of Reproductive Cloning and Responses
    1. Reproductive Liberty: The Only Way to Have a Genetically Related Child
    2. Cloning and Savior Siblings
    3. Cloning In Order to “Replace” a Deceased Child
    4. The Resultant Loss of Therapeutic Cloning for Stem Cell Research and Treating Diseases
  5. Arguments Against Reproductive Cloning and Responses
    1. The Right to an Open Future
    2. The Right to a Unique Genetic Identity
    3. Cloning is Wrong because it is “Playing God” or because it is “Unnatural”
    4. The Dangers of Cloning
    5. Cloning Entails the Creation of Designer Children, or it Turns Children into Commodities
    6. Cloning and the Ambiguity of Familial Roles
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Types of Cloning

a. Recombinant DNA Technology / Molecular Cloning

DNA/Molecular cloning has been in use by molecular biologists since the early 1960s. When scientists wish to replicate a specific gene to facilitate more thorough study, molecular cloning is implemented in order to generate multiple copies of the DNA fragment of interest. In this process, the specific DNA fragment is transferred from one organism into a self-replicating genetic element, e.g., a bacterial plasmid (Allison, 2007).

Because this kind of cloning does not result in the genesis of a human organism, it has no reproductive intent or goals, and it does not result in the creation and destruction of embryos, there is little to no contention regarding its use.

b. Therapeutic Cloning




Embryonic stem cells are derived from human embryos at approximately five days post-fertilization, in the blastocyst stage of development. Because of their plasticity, embryonic stem cells can be manipulated to become any cell in the human body, e.g., neural cells, retinal cells, liver cells, pancreatic cells, or heart cells. Many scientists hope that, with proper research and application, embryonic stem cells can be used to treat a wide variety of afflictions, e.g., tissue toxicity resulting from cancer therapy (National Cancer Institute, 1999) Alzheimer’s disease (Gearhart, 1998), Parkinson’s disease (Freed et al, 1999; National Institute of Neurological Disorders and Strokes, 1999; Wager et al. 1999; Gearhart, 1998), diabetes (Voltarelli et al, 2007; Shapiro et al., 2000), heart disease (Lumelsky, 2001; Zulewski, 2001), and limb paralysis (Kay and Henderson, 2001).

One current obstacle for the successful use of embryonic stem cells for disease therapy concerns immunological rejection. If a patient were to receive stem cell therapy in order to treat some affliction, her body may reject the stem cells for the same reason human bodies have a tendency to reject donated organs: the body tends to not recognize, and therefore reject, foreign cells. One way to overcome stem cell rejection is by creating embryos through somatic cell nuclear transfer with the patient’s own DNA. In 2008, a California research team succeeded in creating embryos via SCNT and growing them to the blastocyst stage (French et al., 2008). In SCNT, an ovum is emptied of its own nucleus, its DNA, and the chromosomal DNA from another person (in the case, a patient’s) is inserted. The ovum is then artificially induced to begin dividing as if it had been naturally fertilized (usually via the use of an electrical current). Once the embryo is approximately five days old, the stem cells are removed, cultured, differentiated to the desired type of body cell, and inserted back into the patient (the genetic donor in this case). Since the embryo was a genetic duplicate of the patient, there would be no immunological rejection. One use of this technology, for example, is to help treat individuals in the aftermath of a heart attack. Using SCNT to create a genetically identical blastocyst, new healthy cells could be derived and inserted back into the genetic donor’s heart in order to replace the damaged cardiac cells (Strauer, 2009).

It may also be possible to use therapeutic cloning to repair defective genes by homologous recombination (Doetschman et al., 1987). Cellular models of diseases can be developed as well, along with the ability to test drug efficacy: “cloning a single skin cell from a patient with a disease could be used to produce inexhaustible amounts of cells and tissue with that disease. The tissue could be experimented upon to understand why disease occurs. It could be used to understand the genetic contribution to disease and to test vast arrays of new drugs which could not be tested in human people” (Savulescu, 2007, 1-2). Pluripotent stem cells can also be used to test drug toxicity which could also diminish the chances of drug-related birth defects (Boiani and Schöler, 2002, 124).

Therapeutic cloning is controversial because isolating the stem cells from the embryo destroys it. Many individuals regard the human embryo as a person with moral rights, and so they consider its destruction to be morally impermissible. Moreover, because the embryos are created with the explicit intention to destroy them, there are concerns that this treats the embryos in a purely instrumental manner (Annas et al.,, 1996). Although some ethicists are in favor of using surplus embryos from fertility treatments for research (since the embryos were slated for destruction in any case), they are simultaneously against creating embryos solely for research due to the concern that doing so treats the embryos purely as means (Outka, 2002; Peters, 2001). Indeed, it is precisely because of these ethical issues that some individuals object to the positive connotations of the term “therapeutic” and refer to this work, instead, as “research cloning.” The term “therapeutic cloning” is, however, more widely used.

c. Reproductive Cloning

SCNT can also be used for reproductive purposes. Unlike therapeutic cloning, the cloned embryo is transferred into a uterus of a female of the same species and would be, upon successful implantation, allowed to gestate as a naturally fertilized egg would. The cloned embryo would possess identical chromosomal DNA as its genetic predecessor, but, because of the use of a different ovum, its mitochondrial DNA (the genetic material inhabiting the cytoplasm of the enucleated ovum) would differ, and, consequently, it would not be 100% genetically identical (unlike monozygotic multiples who, because they are derived from the same ovum, share identical chromosomal and mitochondrial DNA). In addition to its slight genetic difference, the cloned embryo would likely be gestated in a different uterine environment, which can also have an effect in ways that may serve to distinguish it from its genetic predecessor. For example, a cloned entity’s phenotype (its appearance) may look very different than that of its genetic predecessor because the embryo can undergo epigenetic reprogramming, where nongenetic (i.e., environmental) causes influence genes to manifest themselves differently. The result is that the genes behave in ways that may lead to a difference in appearance.

In addition to somatic cell nuclear transfer, there is another, less controversial and less technologically complex, manner of reproductive cloning: artificial embryo twinning. Here, an embryo is created in a Petri dish via In Vitro Fertilization (IVF). The embryo is then induced to divide into genetic copies of itself, thereby artificially mimicking what happens when monozygotic multiples are formed (Illmensee et al., 2009). The embryos are then transferred into a womb and, upon successful implantation and gestation, are born as identical multiples. If implantation is unsuccessful, the process is repeated.

One argument in favor of artificial embryo twinning is that it provides an infertile couple, who may not have been able to produce many viable embryos through IVF, with more embryos that they can then implant for an increased chance at successful reproduction (Robertson, 1994). Because some of the embryos may be saved and implanted later, it is possible to create identical multiples who are not born at the same time. One advantage to doing this is that the later born twin could serve as a blood or bone marrow donor for her older sibling should the need arise; because they are genetically identical, the match would be guaranteed (the converse could also hold, that is, the older individual could serve as a donor for the clone should the latter ever need it. The existence of a cloned person, therefore, could be mutually beneficial, rather than asymmetrical). However, some concerns have been raised. For example, it has been argued that artificially dividing the embryo constitutes an immoral manipulation of it and that, as much as possible, a unique embryo should be allowed to develop without interference (McCormick, 1994). Concerns over individuality have also been raised; whereas naturally occurring twins are valued as individuals, one worry is that embryos created through artificial twinning, precisely because of the synthetic nature of their genesis, may not be as valued (McCormick, 1994).

2. Misconceptions About Cloning and Their Sources

The general public still seems to regard human reproductive cloning as something that can occur only in the realm of science fiction. The portrayal of cloning in movies, television, and even in journalism has spanned from comedic to dangerous. Human clones have often been depicted in movies as nothing but carbon copies of their genetic predecessor with no minds of their own (e.g., Multiplicity and Star Wars: Attack of the Clones), as products of scientific experiments that have gone horribly wrong, resulting in deformed quasi-humans (Alien Resurrection) or murderous children (Godsend), as persons created simply for spare parts for their respective genetic predecessor (The Island), or as deliberate recreations of famous persons from the past who are expected to act just like their respective predecessor (The Boys from Brazil). Even when depicting nonhuman cloning, films (such as Jurassic Park) tend to portray products of cloning as menacing, modern-day Frankensteinian monsters of sorts, which serve to teach humans a lesson about the dangers of “playing God.”

Many other media outlets, although usually shying away from the ominous representation of clones so prevalent in the movies, have usually portrayed clones as, essentially, facsimiles of their genetic predecessor. On the several occasions which Time Magazine has addressed the issue of cloning, the cover illustrates duplicate instances of the same picture. For example, the February 19, 2001 cover shows two mirror image infants staring at each other, the tagline suggesting that cloning may be used by grieving parents who wish to resurrect their dead child. Even a Discovery Channel program, meant to educate its viewers on the nature of cloning, initially portrays a clone as nothing more than a duplicate of the original person. Interestingly enough, however, a few minutes into the program, the narrator, speaking over a picture of two identical cows, says: “But even if a clone person is created, that doesn’t mean it would be an exact copy of the original.” Yet almost immediately afterwards, the same narrator calls a clone “You, version 2.0.”

As philosopher Patrick Hopkins has pointed out, media conceptions about what human cloning entails, and the type of offspring that will arise from cloning, employ the tacit premise that clones are nothing but copies. The predominate belief that fuels this conception is that genetic determinism is true, i.e., that a person’s genes are the sole determining factor of her behavior and physical appearance; essentially, that a person’s identity is solely determined by her genetic constitution. If a person were to believe that genetic determinism is true, then it follows that she believes that a cloned person would be psychologically identical with her genetic predecessor because they are (almost) genetically identical. Hopkins also points out that, like the narrator in the Discovery Channel program, many media outlets “engage in confusing, contradictory bits of double-talk (or double-show). The images and not-very-clever headlines all convey unsettling messages that clones will be exact copies, while inside the stories go to some effort to educate us that clones will not in fact be exact copies” (1998, 129-130).

3. Cloning Mammals: A Brief History

In 1894, Hans Driesch cloned a sea urchin through inducing twinning by shaking an embryonic sea urchin in a beaker full of sea water until the embryo cleaved into two distinct embryos. In 1902, Hans Spemann cloned a salamander embryo through inducing twinning as well, using a hair from his infant son as a noose to divide the embryo.  In 1928, Spemann successfully cloned a salamander using nuclear transfer. This involved enucleating a single-celled salamander embryo and inserting it with the nucleus of a differentiated salamander embryonic cell.  In 1951, Robert Briggs and Thomas Kling, using Spemann’s methods of embryonic nucleus transfer, successfully cloned frogs. In 1962, John Gurdon announced that he too had successfully cloned frogs but, unlike Briggs and Kling’s method, he did so by transferring differentiated intestinal nuclei from feeding tadpoles (Wilmut et al., 2000). Gurdon’s successful use of differentiated nuclei, rather than the embryonic nuclei used by Briggs and Kling, was particularly surprising to the scientific community. Because embryonic cells are undifferentiated, and therefore extremely malleable, it was not too surprising that transferred embryonic nuclei produced distinct embryos when inserted into an enucleated oocyte. However, inciting differentiated nuclei to behave as undifferentiated nuclei was thought to be impossible, since the conventional wisdom at the time was that once a cell was differentiated (e.g., once it became a cardiac cell, a liver cell, or a blood cell) it could never reverse into an undifferentiated state. It was for this reason that, for a long time, creating a cloned embryo from adult somatic cells was thought to be impossible – it would require taking long-time differentiated cells and getting them to behave like the totipotent cells (cells that are able to differentiate into any cell type, including the ability to form an entirely distinct organism) found in newly fertilized eggs.

In 1995, Dr. Ian Wilmut and Dr. Keith Campbell successfully cloned two mountain sheep, Megan and Morag, from embryonic sheep cells. One year later, in 1996, Wilmut and Campbell successfully cloned the first mammal to be born from an adult somatic cell, specifically an udder cell (a sheep’s mammary gland): Dolly the sheep (Wilmut et al., 1997). In other words, Wilmut and Campbell were able to take a fully differentiated adult cell and revert it back to an undifferentiated, totipotent, state. This was the first time the process had been accomplished for mammalian reproduction. Furthermore, they were able to create a viable pregnancy and produce from it a healthy lamb (however, there were 276 failed attempts before Dolly was created, which, as it will be discussed below, creates concerns over the safety and efficacy of the procedure). Dolly the sheep died in 2003 after having been euthanized due to her suffering from pulmonary adenomatosis, a disease fairly common in sheep that are kept indoors; indeed, many members of Dolly’s flock had succumbed to the same disease. Additionally, she suffered from arthritis. Before she died, she produced six healthy lambs through natural reproduction. Since Dolly, many more mammals have been cloned through the use of SCNT. Some examples are deer, ferrets (Li et al., 2006), mules (Lovgren, 2003), other sheep, goats, cows, mice, pigs, rabbits, a gaur, dogs, and cats. One possible use of reproductive cloning technology is to help save endangered species (Lanza et al., 2000). In 2005, two endangered gray wolves were cloned in Korea (Oh et al., 2008).

The successful cloning of household pets holds special significance in that, when discussing the circumstances that led to their cloning, we can begin to discuss the ethical issues that arise in human reproductive cloning. In 2001, the first feline created via somatic cell nuclear transfer was born. She was named CC, short for “Copy Cat,” and was born at the College of Veterinary Medicine at Texas A&M University. The research that led to her creation was funded by the California based company “Genetic Savings and Clone,” who, between 2004 and 2006, offered grieving pet owners a chance to clone their sick or deceased pets (they closed their doors in 2006 due to the unsustainability of their business). What is most striking about CC is not simply her mere existence, but also that CC does not look nor act like her feline progenitor, Rainbow. Whereas Rainbow, a calico, is stocky and has patches of tan, orange, and white throughout her body, CC barely resembles a calico at all. Not only is she lanky and thin, she has a grey coat over a white body and is lacking the patches of orange or tan typical to calicos. There are personality differences between Rainbow and CC as well; whereas Rainbow is described as a shy, reticent, and a more “hands-off” kind of cat, CC is described as more playful, inquisitive, and affectionate (Hays, 2003).

“Genetic Savings and Clone” was founded by Lou Hawthorne, who was seeking a means to clone his family’s beloved dog Missy. Although Missy died before she was successfully cloned, Hawthorne banked her DNA in the hopes of ultimately succeeding in this endeavor. In 2004, a Texas woman paid $50,000 to clone her deceased Maine Coone Nicky and, as a result, Little Nicky, the world’s first commercially cloned cat, was born.  This was followed, in 2005, by the birth of Snuppy, the world’s first cloned dog. In 2007, three clones from Missy’s DNA were created and returned to the Hawthorne family. All this has incited some pet owners to pay large sums of money to clone their beloved deceased pets. Alan and Kristine Wolf paid thousands of dollars to have their deceased cat, Spot, cloned from skin cells they had preserved. According to the Wolfs, preserving Spot’s skin cells, in their mind, was almost equivalent to having Spot himself preserved. In other words, the Wolfs (and the woman who cloned Nicky) were willing to spend an exorbitant amount of money to clone their pets not just in order to receive another pet, but to, rather, receive what was, in their eyes, the same pet that they had lost (Masterson, 2010).

This allows us to begin exploring the ethical issues in the reproductive cloning debate. Some questions that arise are: Why did these individuals regard the recreation of the same DNA to equate to the recreation of the same entity that had died? Will these expectations transfer over to human cloning, where people will regard cloned children as the same individuals as their genetic predecessors, and therefore treat them with this expectation in mind? Will cloning, thus, compromise a child’s identity? Are such concerns grave enough to permanently ban reproductive cloning altogether?

4. Arguments in Favor of Reproductive Cloning and Responses

a. Reproductive Liberty: The Only Way to Have a Genetically Related Child

The Argument.

Procreative liberty is a right well established in Western political culture (Dworkin, 1994). However, not everyone is physically capable of procreating through traditional modes of conception. Cloning may be the only way for an otherwise infertile couple to have a genetically related child. Therefore, providing cloning as an option contributes to a greater scope of procreative liberty (Häyry, 2003; Harris, 2004; Robertson, 1998). For example, a couple may be able to generate only a few embryos from IVF procedures; cloning via artificially induced twinning would increase the number of embryos to a quantity that is more likely to result in a live birth. In another case, the male partner in a relationship may be unable to produce viable sperm and, instead of seeking a sperm donor, the couple can choose to use SCNT in order to produce a genetic copy of the prospective father. Since the prospective mother would use her own ova, they would both contribute genetically to the child (albeit with a different proportion than a couple who conceived using gamete cells).  In yet another example, neither parent may have usable gametes, so they employ a donor ovum, clone one of the two parents, and gestate the fetus in the female’s uterus. Or, perhaps one of the prospective parents is predisposed to certain genetic disorders and, in order to completely avoid their offspring inheriting these disorders, they decide to clone the other prospective parent. A single woman may want to have a baby, and would rather clone herself instead of using donated sperm. Also, cloning may give homosexual couples the opportunity to have genetically related children (this is especially true for homosexual women where one partner provides the mitochondrial DNA and the other partner provides the chromosomal DNA). These are a few examples of how cloning may provide a genetically related child to a person otherwise unable to have one. Because cloning may be the only way some people can procreate, to deny cloning to these people would be a violation of procreative liberty (Robertson, 2006).

Response 1: Negative vs. positive right to procreate.

One response is to distinguish between a positive right to procreate and a negative right to procreate (Pearson, 2007), and argue that reproductive liberty can be fully respected in the latter sense, and only conditionally respected in the former sense. This conditional respect may support the permissibility of prohibiting human cloning for reproductive purposes.

A negative right to x means that no one has the prima facie right to interfere in your request to fulfill x.  If you possess a negative right to x, this entails only one obligation on the behalf of others: the obligation to not obstruct your obtainment of x. For example, if I have a negative right to life, what this entails is that others have an obligation to not kill me, since this obstructs or hinders my right. Another way to regard it is that a negative right only requires passive obligations (the obligation to not do something or to refrain from acting).

A positive right requires more from obligation-bearers; it requires that active steps be taken in order to provide the right-bearers with the means to fulfill that right. If I have a positive right to life, for instance, it is not just that others have an obligation to not kill me; they have a further obligation to provide me with any services that I would need to ensure my survival. That is, the obligation becomes an active one as well as a passive one: an obligation to not destroy my life and also to provide services that enable me to preserve my life.

Keeping this distinction in mind, it is possible to deny that the right to reproduce is a positive right in the first place. That is, while we ought not to prevent anyone from procreating, we are not required to provide them with any technology whatsoever in order to enable them to procreate if they cannot do so by their own means. Hence, limiting access to certain types of assisted reproductive technologies to an otherwise infertile couple would not necessarily infringe on their (negative) right to procreate (Courtwright and Doron, 2007). Some have argued the opposing side, however, and have maintained that respect for procreative liberty not only entails access to artificial reproductive technology, but also the right to employ gamete donors and surrogate mothers (Ethics Committee of the American Fertility Society, 1985).

Response 2: Procreative liberty is not categorical.

Another possible response is to stress that, even if there is a positive right to procreate, the right is a prima facie, rather than a categorical, one and it is not the case that any step taken to combat infertility is in itself ethical (McCormick, 1993).  Therefore, determining what types of services can be offered to infertile couples must be tempered with certain considerations, e.g., the safety of the offspring born as a result of these services must be taken into account. If a particular type of reproductive technology poses a health risk to the resulting children, this is grounds enough to prevent the use of that technology (Cohen, 1996). In other words, even granting that individuals have a positive right to procreate, it does not follow from this alone that they should be provided with any means necessary for successful procreation. They may not be entitled to the use of a certain technological advancement (e.g., SCNT) if that advancement is deemed to pose a danger to the resulting offspring. Robertson concedes this objection, but he responds that “if a ban on cloning is justified, then a ban on many other forms of assisted reproduction and genetic selection should be as well, yet few persons are prepared to go that far” (2006, 206).  That is, in order for advocates of this objection to be consistent, they should be equally willing to ban other forms of reproductive technology that may result in harm to potential offspring.

b. Cloning and Savior Siblings

The Argument.

The concept of a “savior sibling,” a child that is deliberately conceived so that she could provide a means (through the donation of bodily fluids, umbilical cord blood, a non-vital organ, or tissue) to save an older sibling from illness or death is not new. What is new is that cloning would ensure that the new child is an appropriate match for the existing ailing person, since they would be genetically identical. Permitting cloning, therefore, would allow for a more expedient means of creating a savior sibling, since the alternatives (using preimplantation genetic diagnosis to screen embryos to determine which are genetically compatible with the sibling, implanting into a womb only the ones that are a match and discarding the others, or creating an embryo through natural reproduction and terminating the pregnancy if it is not a genetic match) are more involved and more time consuming. Of course, the rights of the new child would have to be respected; tissue, organs, or bodily fluids should only be removed given her consent (although this would not apply to umbilical cord blood banking, since the infant lacks the capacity for giving consent) (Robertson, 2006).

Response: Violating Kant’s formula of humanity.

Such a prospect raises concerns that cloning would facilitate viewing the resulting children as objects of manufacture, rather than as individuals with value and dignity of their own. The prospect of creating a child, solely to meet the needs of another child and not for her own sake, reduces the created child to a mere means to achieve the ends of the parents and the sick child. While it is admirable that the parents wish to save their existing child, it is not ethically permissible to create another child solely as an instrument to save the life of her sibling (Quintavalle, 2001).

Another way of explaining it is that creating a child solely for the purposes of providing life-saving aid for another child violates Immanuel Kant’s second principle formulation of the categorical imperative. Kant proscribes treating persons as a mere means, rather than as ends in themselves, maintaining that persons should “act in such a way that [humanity is treated] always at the same time as an end and never simply as a means” (1981, 36). Creating a child for the sole purpose of saving another child violates the formula of humanity because the child is created specifically for this end.

It should be noted, however, that such an objection would apply to any method that is used to create a child for similar reasons, including any other type of reproductive technology or even natural procreation. It is the intention with which a child is created that is in question here, not the method that is used in order to create the child. Another response is that Kant’s dictum is misapplied. A child who is created as a “savior sibling” may still, also, be loved and respected as an individual in her own right, and therefore may not necessarily be treated solely as a means (Boyle and Savulescu, 2001).

c. Cloning In Order to “Replace” a Deceased Child

The Argument.

In his article “Even If It Worked, Cloning Won’t Bring Her Back”, ethicist Thomas Murray recounts a letter he heard read at a congressional hearing regarding human reproductive cloning. A chemist, who was presenting her views in support of reproductive cloning, read a letter by a father grieving the death of his infant son. Murray recounts as follows:

Eleven days ago, as I awaited my turn to testify at a congressional hearing on human reproductive cloning, one of five scientists on the witness list took the microphone. Brigitte Boisselier, a chemist working with couples who want to use cloning techniques to create babies, read aloud a letter from “a father (Dada).” The writer, who had unexpectedly become a parent in his late thirties, describes his despair over his 11-month-old son's death after heart surgery and 17 days of “misery and struggle.” The room was quiet as Boisselier read the man's words: “I decided then and there that I would never give up on my child. I would never stop until I could give his DNA - his genetic make-up - a chance” (2001).

Depriving grieving parents of this unique opportunity, the only opportunity “to get back the child that they lost,” would be morally wrong. Cloning would provide such an opportunity to grieving parents.

Response 1: Assuming genetic determinism.

Like many of the arguments against reproductive cloning listed below, this argument in favor of cloning, despite its emotional appeal, erroneously assumes that genetic determinism is true. The grieving father’s letter maintained that he would never “give up on my child”, and that the way he would achieve this is to “give his DNA – his genetic make-up – a chance.” In other words, the father equated his son as an individual person to his genetic make-up; because he could recreate his son’s genes, he could recreate his son as a person. The tacit implication here is that cloning is desirable because it somehow presents a way to cheat death. It is through cloning that his son could be, in some sense, resurrected.

Given that individuals have sought to clone their deceased pets, the idea that grieving parents would seek to clone a deceased child is not far-fetched. Thomas Murray continues his article by disclosing that he too is a grieving father, having suffered the death of his twenty-year-old daughter who was abducted from her college campus and shot. Yet cloning, Murray continues, “can neither change the fact of death nor deflect the pain of grief” (2001). Murray goes on to stress that, due to varying other influences outside of genetic duplication, a clone would not, in fact, be a mere copy of its genetic predecessor. One interesting point is that both detractors of cloning (e.g., Kass and Callahan, whose views are explored below) and supporters of cloning (like the researcher that read this letter at the congressional hearing) find convergence in committing the same fallacy. Both assume that cloning recreates identity, and they differ only as to the desirability of that consequence. Yet, given that we have evidence that the robust form of genetic determinism these arguments assume is false (Resnik and Vorhaus, 2006; Elliot, 1998), both detractors and supporters of cloning who rely on it produce faulty arguments.

Response 2: A child is not replaceable.

Given the evidence that genetic determinism is false, Murray further stresses that using cloning as a method of replacing a dead child “is unfair. No child should have to bear the oppressive expectation that he or she will live out the life denied to his or her idealized genetic avatar…. Cloning a child to be a reincarnation of someone else is a grotesque, fun-house mirror distortion of parental expectations” (2001). Dan Brock further supports the contention that cloning in order to replace a deceased child is misguided (Brock, 1997). Moreover, because parents have cloned this child with the expressed purpose of replacing a deceased child, the expectations that the new child will be just like the deceased one would be overwhelming and impede the child’s ability to develop her own individuality (Levick, 2004). It should be stressed, however, that this response targets a particular use of cloning (one based on faulty assumptions), not the actual cloning procedure.

d. The Resultant Loss of Therapeutic Cloning for Stem Cell Research and Treating Diseases

The Argument.

Although SCNT is used to create embryos for therapeutic cloning, there is no intent to implant them in order to create children. Rather, the intent is to use the cells of the embryo in order to further research that may ultimately lead to treatments or cures for certain afflictions. Therefore, a categorical ban on SCNT affects not just the prospect of reproductive cloning, but also the research that could be done with cloned embryos. At the very least, the argument concludes, SCNT should be allowed for research and therapeutic purposes (Devolder and Savulescu, 2006; American Medical Association, 2003; Maas, 2001). This was the position presented by Senator Arlen Specter in his proposed Senate Bill 2439, called the “Human Cloning Prohibition Act of 2002:  A Bill to Prohibit Human [Reproductive] Cloning While Preserving Important Areas of Medical Research, Including Stem Cell Research.”

Response 1: Therapeutic cloning leads to reproductive cloning.

The first response maintains that, because therapeutic cloning and reproductive cloning both implement SCNT, allowing the procedure to be perfected for therapeutic cloning makes it more likely that it will later be used for reproductive purposes (Rifkin, 2002; Kass, 1998)

Response 2: Embryo experimentation is unethical.

The second response applies not just to therapeutic cloning, but to any type of embryo experimentation. From the time that an ovum is fertilized and syngamy (the fusion of two gametes to form a new and distinct genetic code) has successfully taken place, there exists a subject, the embryo, which is a bearer of dignity, moral status, and moral rights. It is unethical to experiment on an embryo for the same reason it is unethical to experiment on any human being and since embryo experimentation often results in the destruction of the embryo, this equates to murdering the embryo (Deckers, 2007; Oduncu, 2003; Novak, 2001). Typically, those who offer the second response (e.g., the Catholic Church) regard the human embryo as a complete moral subject upon conception (Pope John Paul II, 1995; Pope Paul VI, 1968), and therefore any experiment that harms them or destroys them is morally tantamount to any experiment that would destroy a person.

5. Arguments Against Reproductive Cloning and Responses

a. The Right to an Open Future

The Argument.

According to some ethicists who oppose human cloning, a cloned child’s identity and individuality will be compromised given that she will be “saddled with a genotype that has already lived” (Kass, 1998, 56; see also Annas, 1998 and Kitcher, 1997). Because of the expectations that the cloned child will re-live the life of her genetic predecessor, the child would necessarily be deprived of her right to an open future. Because all children deserve to have a life and a future that is completely open to them in terms of its prospects (Feinberg, 1980), and because being the product of cloning would necessarily deprive the resulting child of these prospects, cloning is seriously immoral. In a sense, this objection maintains that a cloned child would either lack the free will to live her life according to her own desire and goals or that, at the very least, her free will would be severely restricted by her parents or the society that has certain expectations of her given her genetic lineage. The child would be destined to live in the shadows of her genetic predecessor (Holm, 1998).

Response 1: Faulting cloning for the misconceptions of others.

This argument is unsuccessful in illustrating that there is something intrinsically morally wrong with cloning. The subject of this objection is not cloning itself, but rather the erroneous attitude that parents will have in regard to their cloned child. The child’s very desire to be different from her predecessor illustrates that she is not destined to be like her predecessor. Once prospective parents, and society in general, come to understand that cloned children will possess just as much individuality as any other person, it is possible that these fears, and the attempts to control the child’s future, will largely abate (Wachbroit, 1997). Additionally, if the reason people treat cloned children unfavorably is due to their misconceptions about cloning, then the proper response is not to ban cloning at the expense of compromising procreative liberty, but rather work to rectify these prejudices and misconceptions (Burley and Harris, 1999).

Moreover, it is not just parents of cloned children that may be guilty of violating the child’s right to an open future;  many parents are, to varying degrees of severity, already guilty of violating such a right with their naturally created children, and often times those attempts are subject to failure (see Agar, 2004, 106 for such an example). If such parents are not deprived of their opportunity to have children out of concern that they will violate their child’s right to an open future, then we seem hard pressed to find a reason to deprive couples who would turn to cloning for reproductive purposes of a similar opportunity.

Response 2: Assuming genetic determinism (again).

At its core, however, this objection assumes the very controversial thesis that either a person’s genes play an almost fatalistic role in her life decisions, or that individuals in society will assume some robust version of genetic determinism to be true and will treat cloned children according to that assumption. As abovementioned, there is much evidence to suggest that genetic determinism is not true. In their article “Genetic Modification and Genetic Determinism,” David Resnik and Daniel Vorhaus state that, when it comes to genetic modification, “even if a desired trait is successfully expressed it may not actually restrict options for the child… the open future critique paints with a far broader brush, alleging that the act of modification per se impacts the child's right to an open future. And it is this claim that we reject...” (2006, 9). The same can be said about cloning (Pence, 1998 and 2008; Wachbroit, 1997). Even if a cloned child did display certain behavioral traits belonging to her genetic predecessor, it is unclear whether the similarity in traits entails that a child’s future would be closed off. Moreover, there is much evidence that, usually, the general public rejects genetic determinism (Hopkins, 1998).

There is evidence, however, that some would regard cloning as a method for resuscitating the dead (the grieving father in Murray’s article attests to this, as well as the individuals who are willing to pay thousands of dollars in order to clone a deceased pet). This supports Kass’ claim that many people may expect a cloned child to be like her genetic predecessor. However, this misconception may quickly be rectified simply by observing the unique personality of the cloned child, especially since her experiences and her nurture, removed by at least a generation, will be substantially different than that of her genetic predecessor (Dawkins, 1998; Pence, 1998).

b. The Right to a Unique Genetic Identity

The Argument.

Because cloning entails recreating an existing person’s genetic code (with the exception of the difference in mitochondrial DNA), some argue that cloning would, necessarily, entail a violation of the cloned child’s right to a distinctive genetic identity (European Parliament, 1998). According to this objection, our DNA is what endows each human being with uniqueness and dignity (Callahan, 1993). Because cloning recreates a pre-existing DNA sequence, the cloned child would be denied that uniqueness and, therefore, her dignity would be compromised. This objection appears to be an incarnation of the objection from the Right to an Open Future. Certainly the concerns are similar: that a cloned child would be deprived of her own individual identity because of her genetic origins. However, whereas in the objection from the Right to an Open Future, the cloned child is deprived of individuality based on the perception of others (and, as is developed above, this does not seem to really be an objection to the practice of cloning simpliciter), this objection indicates that there is something inherently individuality-compromising, and therefore dignity-compromising, in recreating an existing genetic code. If this objection is successful, if recreating a pre-existing genetic code is intrinsically morally objectionable, then it would seem to present an objection to the actual cloning process.

Response 1: Genetic duplication and identical multiples.

Callahan argues that there is something intrinsically identity-depriving, and therefore dignity-depriving, in duplicating a genetic code. However, there is much evidence to counter this claim. As abovementioned, CC the cat neither looks nor acts like Rainbow, her genetic predecessor. However, the strongest evidence against this claim is the existence of identical multiples, who are, in essence, clones of nature (Pence, 2004; Gould, 1997). No one claims that identical multiples’ right to a unique genetic identity was compromised simply in virtue of their creation, which calls into question whether such a right exists in the first place (Silver, 1998; Tooley, 1998; Rhodes, 1995). If Callahan’s concerns were accurate, identical multiples would fail to be individuals in their own right, and, consequently, be harmed because of this. However, there is no evidence that identical multiples feel this way, and there does not seem to be anything inherent about sharing a genetic code that compromises individuality (Elliot, 1998). The fact that identical multiples do not seem harmed or deprived of individuality merely by virtue of not possessing a unique genetic code is evidence that Callahan’s concern against cloning in this regard is misguided.

Response 2: Forgetting nurture.

Lastly, proponents of this objection ignore the very important role that nurture has in shaping a person’s identity. A cloned child would be gestated in a different uterine environment. She would be born into either the same family, but with a different dynamic, as her genetic predecessor, or be born into a different family altogether. She would also likely be raised in a much different society (e.g., a child born in 2010 would have vastly different social influences than a child born in the 1960s or 1970s). She would have different friends, attend different schools, play different games, watch different television shows, listen to different music. The generational and historical differences between a clone and her genetic predecessor would undoubtedly go a long way when it comes to shaping the personality of the former (Pence, 1998; Dawkins, 1998; Harris, 1997; Bor, 1997).

What forms or shapes each person’s individual identity is an intricate interaction of genetics and nurture (Ridley, 2003). While being genetically identical to a pre-existing person will most likely result in some similarities, it will certainly not be strong enough to deprive a cloned child of her individuality or dignity.  A cloned child’s future would remain open, and there is no evidence that she is denied something irreplaceably unique by not having a unique genetic code. Moreover, concerns that genetic duplication compromises dignity overemphasize the role that genetics has as the source of human dignity. Human dignity, some philosophers have argued, has its source in virtue of our being persons and autonomous rational beings. Since, presumably, a clone would still be a person and an autonomous rational being, a clone would certainly retain her human dignity (Glannon, 2005; Elliot, 1998).

c. Cloning is Wrong because it is “Playing God” or because it is “Unnatural”

The Argument.

Another common concern is that cloning is morally wrong because it oversteps the boundaries of humans’ role in scientific research and development. These boundaries are set by either God (and therefore cloning is wrong because it is “playing God”) or nature (and therefore cloning is wrong because it is “unnatural”). Any method of procreation that does not implement traditional modes of conception, i.e., not involving the union of sperm and ova, is guilty of one (or both) of these infractions (Goodman, 2008; Tierney, 2007).  Moreover, advocates of this objection caution against removing God from the process of creation altogether, which, it is argued, is what reproductive cloning achieves (Rikfin, 2000).

Response 1: Clarifying the meaning of “playing God.”

Advocates of the “playing God” objection have the onus to define exactly what “playing God” means. One possible definition of “playing God” is that anything that interferes with nature, or the natural progression of life, interferes with God’s plan for humanity, and is therefore morally wrong. But this is too vague; humans constantly interfere with nature in ways that are not morally criticized. Almost all instances of medical advancements in the past 100 years (e.g., vaccines against diseases, respirators, incubators for preterm infants, pacemakers, etc.) interfere with nature in the sense that they prevent otherwise harmful or fatal afflictions from taking their toll on a human body. Would the same advocates of this objection against cloning object to artificial insulin injections to treat diabetes? (Glannon, 2005). To be more extreme, almost everything humans engage in, from wearing clothing, to using phones and computers, to indoor plumbing, all, in some sense, interfere with some aspect of nature.

Perhaps the more charitable understanding is that “playing God” is morally wrong when it comes to cloning because it is a process that artificially creates life, outside of the practice of sexual intercourse (Meilaender, 1997). Adhering to this definition of “playing God”, however, would condemn any form of artificial reproductive technology, as well as cloning, e.g., IVF, artificial insemination, or intrauterine insemination. In addition, anything that thwarts the natural process of conception (i.e., birth control) may also be morally condemned.  In the “Instruction on Respect for Human Life in Its Origin and on the Dignity of Procreation,” the Catholic Church denounces all forms of reproductive technology on the grounds that reproductive creation is strictly God’s domain (Congregation for the Doctrine of the Faith, 1987). However, most people who denounce human cloning on the grounds that it “plays God” do not denounce other forms of artificial reproduction on similar grounds.

Response 2: Knowing God’s will.

Yet another response is that this objection purports to know what God’s will is in regards to technological advancements such as cloning. However, since key religious texts (e.g., The Bible, The Torah, or the Qu’ran) make no mention of such advancements, it is presumably impossible to determine what God would have to say about them. In other words, inferences about God’s will on such matters are tenuous because we have little basis from which to draw these purported moral inferences (Pence, 2008).

Response 3: Biologism Fallacy.

One response to the “unnatural” objection is similar to the first response to the “playing God” objection; most everything humans do, from medicine to modern forms of sanitation, are “unnatural”, and most are not considered morally objectionable as a consequence. A second response is that such an objection commits what philosopher Daniel Maguire calls the “Biologism Fallacy”: “the fallacious effort to wring a moral mandate out of raw biological facts” (1983, 148). In other words, “unnatural” is not synonymous with “immoral” (and conversely, “natural” is not synonymous with “moral”). While it is true that cloning (along with other types of reproductive technologies) is not the “natural” way of conceiving a child, this alone does not render cloning immoral.

d. The Dangers of Cloning

The Argument.

Many philosophers and ethicists who would otherwise support reproductive cloning concede that concern for the safety of children born via cloning is reason to caution against its use (Harris, 2004; Glannon, 2005).  The claim is that a cloned child would be in danger of suffering from severe genetic defects as a result of being a clone, or that cloning would result in a high number of severely defective embryos before one healthy human embryo is developed. Ian Wilmut, Dolly’s creator, has denounced human reproductive cloning as too dangerous to attempt (Travis, 2001). According to Wilmut, “Dolly was derived from 277 embryos, so the other 276 didn’t make it. The previous year’s work, which led to the birth and survival of Megan and Morag, used more than 200 embryos. We have success rates of roughly one in a hundred or less” (Klotzko, 1998, 134). Even if a clone were to appear healthy at birth, there are concerns about health problems arising later in life. For example, while there is no evidence that Dolly’s respiratory issues were due to her being a clone, questions remain whether her arthritis, which is uncommon among sheep her age, could have resulted because of the nature of her genesis (Williams, 2003). Even attempting to perfect human reproductive cloning would entail a trial and error approach that would lead to the destruction of many embryos, and may produce severely disabled children before a healthy one is born.

Response 1: The nonidentity problem.

One response typically given by philosophers when concerning the ethics of preconception decisions that may lead to the birth of a disabled child involves an appeal to Derek Parfit’s nonidentity problem (Parfit, 1984, though Parfit himself does not apply this to cloning). Applied to preconception choices, Parfit’s argument can be applied as follows. Suppose I desire to get pregnant, but am currently suffering from a physical ailment that would result in conceiving and birthing an infant with developmental impairments. Yet, if I were to wait two months, my ailment would pass and I would conceive a perfectly healthy baby. Most people would agree that I should wait those two months; and, indeed, if I do not wait, many people would say that I acted wrongly. The resulting child, moreover, would most likely be identified as the victim of my actions. This intuitive response, however, is surprisingly tricky to defend.  If harm is defined as making someone worse off than she otherwise would have been, it is difficult to maintain that I harmed the resulting child by my actions, even if she were impaired. For the child that would have been born two months later would not have been the same child that is born if I do not wait; the impaired child would never have existed had I waited those two months. Unless the child’s life is so bad that her nonexistence would be preferable, I did not make the child worse off by conceiving her and giving birth to her with those impairments, and thus I did not harm her. Because I did not harm her, I did not do anything morally wrong in this circumstance. The argument can best be standardized as follows:

1. I have only harmed an individual if I had made her worse off than she otherwise would have been had it not been for my actions.

2. Only if I have harmed someone can my action be deemed morally wrong.

3. A child born with mental, physical, or developmental impairments usually does not have a life that is so bad that it renders nonexistence preferable.

4. Therefore, a child born with mental, physical or developmental impairments is not made worse off by being brought into existence.

5. Therefore, deliberate conception, gestation, and birthing of a child with mental, physical, or developmental impairments does not, usually, harm the child (unless the impairments are so bad that they make the child’s life worse than not having existed at all).

6. Therefore, I have (usually) done nothing morally wrong by deliberately bringing into existence a child who suffers from mental, physical, or developmental impairments.

Using the nonidentity problem in the context of the reproductive cloning debate yields the following result: The alternative to being born a clone is not to be born at all. Unless the cloned child’s life is made so horrible by her disabilities that it would have been better that she not been born at all, she was not harmed by being brought into existence via cloning, even if she is born with genetic defects as a result. As long as the cloned child has a life that, despite her genetic defect, is still worth living, then it would still be permissible to use cloning to bring her into being (Lane, 2006).

It is important to note, however, that the nonidentity problem is controversial, and that not all philosophers and ethicists agree with its conclusion (Weinberg, 2008; Cohen, 1996). Indeed, many argue that it would be morally impermissible to bring a child into the world who suffers, even if the child’s life has a net value that renders it worth living (Steinbock and McClamrock, 1994).

Response 2: The dangers of natural reproduction.

Natural reproduction can itself produce dangerous results. Women dispose of fertilized eggs during their menstrual cycle more often than they are aware; one study claims that as many as 73% of fertilized eggs do not survive to 6 weeks gestation (Boklage, 1990). From the ones that do implant, approximately 2% to 3% of newborn infants suffer from congenital abnormities of varying degrees of severity (Kumar et al., 2004). If safety concerns about cloning are severe enough to ban its practice, this can only be justified if cloning were more risky (that is, resulted in the birth of more children with more severe abnormalities) than natural reproduction. Some couples choose to reproduce in full knowledge that one or both of them harbor genetic disorders that may be passed along to their offspring, and some of these are rather severe, such as Huntington’s disease. Yet these parents are not prohibited from procreating because of this. Therefore, if parents are not prohibited from procreating on the grounds that they may pass along a severe genetic defect to their children, then it is difficult to deny a set of parents who can only rely on cloning for procreation the chance to do so based on safety reasons alone (unless the abnormalities that may result from cloning are more severe than the abnormalities that may result from natural conception) (Brock, 1997). Similarly, objecting to cloning on the grounds that embryos are sacrificed in order to achieve a live birth is only a valid objection if the number of embryos lost are greater in cloning than in natural reproduction.

Finally, even if safety concerns are sufficient to warrant a current ban on human reproductive cloning, such concerns would be temporary, and would abate as cloning becomes safer. Indeed, safety concerns led the National Bioethics Advisory Commission (1997) to recommend a temporary, rather than permanent, moratorium on human reproductive cloning.

e. Cloning Entails the Creation of Designer Children, or it Turns Children into Commodities

The Argument.

If we engage in cloning, this objection goes, we run the risk of inserting our will too much into our procreative decisions; we would get to choose not just to have a child, but what kind of child to have. In doing so, we run the risk of relegating children to the status of mere possessions or commodities, rather than regarding them as beings with their own intrinsic worth (Harakas, 1998; Kass, 1998; Meilaender, 1997).  When a couple engages in sexual intercourse and produces a baby, the child is an “offspring of a man and woman, but a replication of neither; their offspring but not their product whose meaning and destiny they might determine” (Meilaender, 1997, 42). Because cloning involves the artificial process of recreating a pre-existing genetic code, prospective parents could, first, choose their child’s DNA (thereby creating a “designer child”), and, second, because they are creating a “replica” of an existing person, they will consider the child more akin to property than an individual in her own right. These factors will contribute to viewing and treating the child as a mere commodity. The more “artificial” conception becomes, the more the resulting children will be seen as the possessions of the parents, rather than as persons in their own right. Rev. Stanley Harakas puts this point as follows: “Cloning would deliberately deny by design the cloned human being a set of loving and caring parents. The cloned human being would not be the product of love, but of scientific procedures. Rather than being considered persons, the likelihood is that these cloned human beings would be considered ‘objects’ to be used” (1998, 89).

Although he rejects the contention that clones would not be considered persons, Thomas Shannon expresses concerns that the increasing artificiality of conception, not just via the use of cloning, but via the use of all forms of artificial reproductive technologies, will “transform our thinking about ourselves, and the transformation will be in a mechanistic direction” (Shannon and Walter, 2003, 134). That is, the move away from natural conception towards artificial conception will lead to humans collectively regarding themselves as more machine-like rather than as organic beings.

Response 1: Cloning is not genetic modification.

Cloning does not necessarily entail the creation of “designer” children because cloning recreates a pre-existing DNA; it does not involve modifying or enhancing DNA in order to produce a child with certain desired traits. Cloning is not to be equated with genetic modification or enhancement (Wachbroit, 1997; Strong, 1998).

Response 2: Natural vs. artificial conception.

Advocates of the objection that cloning results in the transformation of procreation into manufacture seem to assume that, whereas we do not consider children that arise from natural reproduction as ours to do what we wish with, we would if they arise from artificial conception. That is, the tacit premise is that there is some trait inherent in artificial (i.e., non-sexual) conception that necessitates parents regarding their children as mere objects, and this trait is not found in “natural” conception. Yet, we can look towards the children who are products of modern day artificial reproduction in order to see that such a concern is not supported by the evidence. There are many children who are products of artificial reproductive technologies (IVF, intrauterine insemination, gender selection, and gamete intrafallopian transfer, among others) and there does not seem to be an increase of despotic control over these children on behalf of their parents. One study found that children born from IVF and DI (donor insemination) are faring as well as children born via natural conception. More importantly, given Meilaender’s concern that the quality of parenting is compromised in tandem with the artificiality of conception, the study found that “the quality of parenting in families with a child conceived by assisted conception is superior to that shown by families with a naturally conceived child, even when gamete donation is used in the child's conception” (Golombok et al., 1995, 295; also see Golombok, 2003 and Golombok et al., 2001).

Meilaender may respond that, in these cases, the children are still a product of a unification of sperm and ovum, whereas this is not the case with cloning. However, it is unclear why generating a child via somatic cells is more likely to foster despotism than when the child is generated using germ cells. Some have argued that, on the contrary, a cloned child would feel even closer to the parent from whom she was cloned, given that they would share all their genetic information, rather than just half (Pence, 2008). Moreover, the findings of the study supported the thesis that “genetic ties are less important for family functioning than a strong desire for parenthood” (Golombok et al., 1995, 296), which suggests that the parents of cloned children would not be as caught up with the genetic origins of their offspring, and so their parenting would not be as affected by it, as Meilaender contends. According to the study, the quality of parenting increased in tandem with the amount of effort it took to achieve parenthood. It could be argued, therefore, that the quality of parenting for cloned children would be just as good, if not superior, to that of naturally conceived children.

Response 3: Clones would not be loveless creations.

Harakas claims that cloned children will be deprived of loving parents because their genesis will be one of science, rather than love. The studies conducted by Golombok certainly seem to provide evidence to the contrary. Intentionally taking steps to create a child via cloning (or any other kind of reproductive technology) could be seen, instead, as a mutual affirmation of love on behalf of the prospective parents and clear evidence that they really desired the resulting child. Whereas in sexual reproduction the child may be a product of chance, a cloned child would be a product of deliberate choice, which, according to some philosophers, could be a superior method of creation in some respects (Buchanan et al. 2000). Creating a child via cloning does not entail that there is a lack of mutual love between the parents, or that the resulting child would be any less loved (Strong, 1998). Genesis via sexual reproduction is neither a necessary nor a sufficient condition for being born to a set of loving parents and in a nurturing environment.

f. Cloning and the Ambiguity of Familial Roles

The Argument.

Genetically speaking, a cloned child would be her genetic predecessor’s identical twin sibling. If the child is cloned with the intent to serve as the social child of her genetic predecessor, she would be, genetically, her social mother’s twin sister (or his social father’s twin brother), and her social grandparents’ genetic daughter. The concern is that such a radical alteration of familial relationships would be detrimental to the cloned child (Kass, 1998; O’Neil, 2002). As Paul Ramsey puts it: “To mix the parental and the twin relation might well be psychologically disastrous for the young” (Ramsey, 1970). Wide-spread cloning would exacerbate the problem by distorting generational boundaries, which would add a layer of confusion to society’s conception of the nature of the family, and the roles of its individual members (Kass, 1998).

Response 1: No such confusion is likely to arise.

There are two responses to this response. First, doubts can be cast as to whether this confusion would really ensue. Second, even if such confusion did result, it is questionable whether it would be any more detrimental to the child than any confusion that currently exists about parental roles given certain reproductive technologies. For example, it is physically possible for a child to have as many as six distinct “parents”: three genetic parents (the mitochondrial DNA donor, the somatic cell donor used to re-nucleate an enucleated ovum, and the sperm donor), one gestational parent, and two (perhaps even more) social parents. If a cloned child would not experience any less confusion than a child in such a situation, then we would be hard pressed to show why the prospective parents of the former ought to be denied the opportunity to have a genetically related child based on these grounds alone (Harris, 2004). Moreover, doubts can be cast as to whether the ambiguity of genetic lineage caused by the cloning relationship will really result in the consequences Kass and O’Neil are fretting. A social father, for example, is not likely to suddenly rescind his responsibilities toward his daughter because the child is, genetically, his wife’s twin sister (Wachbroit, 1997). Finally, as is evident from children raised by adoptive parents, social parents usually retain the honorific role as the child’s “real” parents, even though there are no genetic ties between them and the adopted child. In other words, what defines a parent seems to have less to do with genetics and more to do with who performs the social role of mother and father (Purdy, 2005).

Response 2: Such confusion would not warrant a prohibition on cloning.

Even if there were such confusion, however, would it be so detrimental as to warrant banning reproductive cloning altogether? Moreover, even if there were a detriment, it is unclear whether that would be a result of society’s prejudice and fear of human cloning, or a result that inherently comes with being a clone. Finally, it would have to be clear that being the genetic twin to a social parent is so detrimental that it would warrant interfering with the prospective parents’ reproductive liberty. Indeed, for any purported harm that may come from cloning (whether physical, psychological, or emotional), it must be argued why those harms are sufficient for banning reproductive cloning if comparable harm would not be sufficient for banning any other kind of reproductive method, whether natural or artificial (Harris, 2004; Robertson, 2006).

6. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

Bertha Alvarez Manninen
Arizona State University at the West Campus
U. S. A.

Animals and Ethics

What place should non-human animals have in an acceptable moral system? These animals exist on the borderline of our moral concepts; the result is that we sometimes find ourselves according them a strong moral status, while at other times denying them any kind of moral status at all. For example, public outrage is strong when knowledge of "puppy mills" is made available; the thought here is that dogs deserve much more consideration than the operators of such places give them. However, when it is pointed out that the conditions in a factory farm are as bad as, if not much worse than, the conditions in a puppy mill, the usual response is that those affected are “just animals” after all, and do not merit our concern.  Philosophical thinking on the moral standing of animals is diverse and can be generally grouped into three general categories: Indirect theories, direct but unequal theories, and moral equality theories.

Indirect theories deny animals moral status or equal consideration with humans due to a lack of consciousness, reason, or autonomy.  Ultimately denying moral  status to animals, these theories may still require not harming animals, but only because doing so causes harm to a human being's morality.  Arguments in this category have been formulated by philosophers such as Immanuel Kant, René Descartes, Thomas Aquinas, Peter Carruthers, and various religious theories.

Direct but unequal theories accord some moral consideration to animals, but deny them a fuller moral status due to their inability to respect another agent's rights or display moral reciprocity within a community of equal agents. Arguments in this category consider the sentience of the animal as sufficient reason not to cause direct harm to animals.  However, where the interests of animals and humans conflict, the special properties of being human such as rationality, autonomy, and self-consciousness accord higher consideration to the interests of human beings.

Moral equality theories extend equal consideration and moral status to animals by refuting the supposed moral relevance of the aforementioned special properties of human beings.  Arguing by analogy, moral equality theories often extend the concept of rights to animals on the grounds that they have similar physiological and mental capacities as infants or disabled human beings.  Arguments in this category have been formulated by philosophers such as Peter Singer and Tom Regan.

Table of Contents

  1. Indirect Theories
    1. Worldview/Religious Theories
    2. Kantian Theories
    3. Cartesian Theories
    4. Contractualist Theories
    5. Implications for the Treatment of Animals
    6. Two Common Arguments Against Indirect Theories
      1. The Argument From Marginal Cases
      2. Problems with Indirect Duties to Animals
  2. Direct but Unequal Theories
    1. Why Animals have Direct Moral Status
    2. Why Animals are not Equal to Human Beings
      1. Only Human Beings Have Rights
      2. Only Human Beings are Rational, Autonomous, and Self-Conscious
      3. Only Human Beings Can Act Morally
      4. Only Human Beings are Part of the Moral Community
  3. Moral Equality Theories
    1. Singer and the Principle of Equal Consideration of Interests
      1. The Argument from Marginal Cases (Again)
      2. The Sophisticated Inegalitarian Argument
      3. Practical Implications
    2. Regan and Animal Rights
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Anthologies
    2. Monographs
    3. Articles

1. Indirect Theories

On indirect theories, animals do not warrant our moral concern on their own, but may warrant concern only in so far as they are appropriately related to human beings. The various kinds of indirect theories to be discussed are Worldview/Religious Theories, Kantian Theories, Cartesian Theories, and Contractualist Theories. The implications these sorts of theories have for the proper treatment of animals will be explored after that. Finally, two common methods of arguing against indirect theories will be discussed.

a. Worldview/Religious Theories

Some philosophers deny that animals warrant direct moral concern due to religious or philosophical theories of the nature of the world and the proper place of its inhabitants. One of the earliest and clearest expressions of this kind of view comes to us from Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.). According to Aristotle, there is a natural hierarchy of living beings. The different levels are determined by the abilities present in the beings due to their natures. While plants, animals, and human beings are all capable of taking in nutrition and growing, only animals and human beings are capable of conscious experience. This means that plants, being inferior to animals and human beings, have the function of serving the needs of animals and human beings. Likewise, human beings are superior to animals because human beings have the capacity for using reason to guide their conduct, while animals lack this ability and must instead rely on instinct. It follows, therefore, that the function of animals is to serve the needs of human beings. This, according to Aristotle, is "natural and expedient" (Regan and Singer, 1989: 4-5).

Following Aristotle, the Christian philosopher St. Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274) argues that since only beings that are rational are capable of determining their actions, they are the only beings towards which we should extend concern "for their own sakes" (Regan and Singer, 1989: 6-12). Aquinas believes that if a being cannot direct its own actions then others must do so; these sorts of beings are merely instruments. Instruments exist for the sake of people that use them, not for their own sake. Since animals cannot direct their own actions, they are merely instruments and exist for the sake of the human beings that direct their actions. Aquinas believes that his view follows from the fact that God is the last end of the universe, and that it is only by using the human intellect that one can gain knowledge and understanding of God. Since only human beings are capable of achieving this final end, all other beings exist for the sake of human beings and their achievement of this final end of the universe.

Remnants of these sorts of views remain in justifications for discounting the interests of animals on the basis of the food chain. On this line of thought, if one kind of being regularly eats another kind of being, then the first is said to be higher on the food chain. If one being is higher than another on the food chain, then it is natural for that being to use the other in the furtherance of its interests. Since this sort of behavior is natural, it does not require any further moral justification.

b. Kantian Theories

Closely related to Worldview/Religious theories are theories such as Immanuel Kant's (1724-1804). Kant developed a highly influential moral theory according to which autonomy is a necessary property to be the kind of being whose interests are to count direclty in the moral assessment of actions (Kant, 1983, 1956). According to Kant, morally permissible actions are those actions that could be willed by all rational individuals in the circumstances. The important part of his conception for the moral status of animals is his reliance on the notion of willing. While both animals and human beings have desires that can compel them to action, only human beings are capable of standing back from their desires and choosing which course of action to take. This ability is manifested by our wills. Since animals lack this ability, they lack a will, and therefore are not autonomous. According to Kant, the only thing with any intrinsic value is a good will. Since animals have no wills at all, they cannot have good wills; they therefore do not have any intrinsic value.

Kant's theory goes beyond the Worldview/Religious theories by relying on more general philosophical arguments about the nature of morality. Rather than simply relying on the fact that it is "natural" for rational and autonomous beings to use non-rational beings as they see fit, Kant instead provides an argument for the relevance of rationality and autonomy. A theory is a Kantian theory, then, if it provides an account of the properties that human beings have and animals lack that warrants our according human beings a very strong moral status while denying animals any kind of moral status at all. Kant's own theory focused on the value of autonomy; other Kantian theories focus on such properties as being a moral agent, being able to exist in a reciprocal relation with other human beings, being able to speak, or being self-aware.

c. Cartesian Theories

Another reason to deny that animals deserve direct concern arises from the belief that animals are not conscious, and therefore have no interests or well-being to take into consideration when considering the effects of our actions. Someone that holds this position might agree that if animals were conscious then we would be required to consider their interests to be directly relevant to the assessment of actions that affect them. However, since they lack a welfare, there is nothing to take directly into account when acting.

One of the clearest and most forceful denials of animal consciousness is developed by Rene Descartes (1596-1650), who argues that animals are automata that might act as if they are conscious, but really are not so (Regan and Singer, 1989: 13-19). Writing during the time when a mechanistic view of the natural world was replacing the Aristotelian conception, Descartes believed that all of animal behavior could be explained in purely mechanistic terms, and that no reference to conscious episodes was required for such an explanation. Relying on the principle of parsimony in scientific explanation (commonly referred to as Occam's Razor) Descartes preferred to explain animal behavior by relying on the simplest possible explanation of their behavior. Since it is possible to explain animal behavior without reference to inner episodes of awareness, doing so is simpler than relying on the assumption that animals are conscious, and is therefore the preferred explanation.

Descartes anticipates the response that his reasoning, if applicable to animal behavior, should apply equally well to human behavior. The mechanistic explanation of behavior does not apply to human beings, according to Descartes, for two reasons. First, human beings are capable of complex and novel behavior. This behavior is not the result of simple responses to stimuli, but is instead the result of our reasoning about the world as we perceive it. Second, human beings are capable of the kind of speech that expresses thoughts. Descartes was aware that some animals make sounds that might be thought to constitute speech, such as a parrot's "request" for food, but argued that these utterances are mere mechanically induced behaviors. Only human beings can engage in the kind of speech that is spontaneous and expresses thoughts.

Descartes' position on these matters was largely influenced by his philosophy of mind and ontology. According to Descartes, there are two mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive kinds of entities or properties: material or physical entities on the one hand, and mental entities on the other. Although all people are closely associated with physical bodies, they are not identical with their bodies. Rather, they are identical with their souls, or the immaterial, mental substance that constitutes their consciousness. Descartes believed that both the complexity of human behavior and human speech requires the positing of such an immaterial substance in order to be explained. However, animal behavior does not require this kind of assumption; besides, Descartes argued, "it is more probable that worms and flies and caterpillars move mechanically than that they all have immortal souls" (Regan and Singer, 1989: 18).

More recently, arguments against animal consciousness have been resurfacing. One method of arguing against the claim that animals are conscious is to point to the flaws of arguments purporting to claim that animals are conscious. For example, Peter Harrison has recently argued that the Argument from Analogy, one of the most common arguments for the claim that animals are conscious, is hopelessly flawed (Harrison, 1991). The Argument from Analogy relies on the similarities between animals and human beings in order to support the claim that animals are conscious. The similarities usually cited by proponents of this argument are similarities in behavior, similarities in physical structures, and similarities in relative positions on the evolutionary scale. In other words, both human beings and animals respond in the same way when confronted with "pain stimuli"; both animals and human beings have brains, nerves, neurons, endorphins, and other structures; and both human beings and animals are relatively close to each other on the evolutionary scale. Since they are similar to each other in these ways, we have good reason to believe that animals are conscious, just as are human beings.

Harrison attacks these points one by one. He points out that so-called pain-behavior is neither necessary nor sufficient for the experience of pain. It is not necessary because the best policy in some instances might be to not show that you are in pain. It is not sufficient since amoebas engage in pain behavior, but we do not believe that they can feel pain. Likewise, we could easily program robots to engage in pain-behavior, but we would not conclude that they feel pain. The similarity of animal and human physical structures is inconclusive because we have no idea how, or even if, the physical structure of human beings gives rise to experiences in the first place. Evolutionary considerations are not conclusive either, because it is only pain behavior, and not the experience of pain itself, that would be advantageous in the struggle for survival. Harrison concludes that since the strongest argument for the claim that animals are conscious fails, we should not believe that they are conscious.

Peter Carruthers has suggested that there is another reason to doubt that animals are conscious Carruthers, 1989, 1992). Carruthers begins by noting that not all human experiences are conscious experiences. For example, I may be thinking of an upcoming conference while driving and not ever consciously "see" the truck in the road that I swerve to avoid. Likewise, patients that suffer from "blindsight" in part of their visual field have no conscious experience of seeing anything in that part of the field. However, there must be some kind of experience in both of these cases since I did swerve to avoid the truck, and must have "seen" it, and because blindsight patients can catch objects that are thrown at them in the blindsighted area with a relatively high frequency. Carruthers then notes that the difference between conscious and non-conscious experiences is that conscious experiences are available to higher-order thoughts while non-conscious experiences are not. (A higher-order thought is a thought that can take as its object another thought.) He thus concludes that in order to have conscious experiences one must be able to have higher-order thoughts. However, we have no reason to believe that animals have higher-order thoughts, and thus no reason to believe that they are conscious.

d. Contractualist Theories

Contractualist Theories of morality construe morality to be the set of rules that rational individuals would choose under certain specified conditions to govern their behavior in society. These theories have had a long and varied history; however, the relationship between contractualism and animals was not really explored until after John Rawls published his A Theory of Justice. In that work, Rawls argues for a conception of justice as fairness. Arguing against Utilitarian theories of justice, Rawls believes that the best conception of a just society is one in which the rules governing that society are rules that would be chosen by individuals from behind a veil of ignorance. The veil of ignorance is a hypothetical situation in which individuals do not know any particular details about themselves, such as their sex, age, race, intelligence, abilities, etc. However, these individuals do know general facts about human society, such as facts about psychology, economics, human motivation, etc. Rawls has his imagined contractors be largely self-interested; each person's goal is to select the rules that will benefit them the most. Since they do not know who exactly they are, they will not choose rules that benefit any one individual, or segment of society, over another (since they may find themselves to be in the harmed group). Instead, they will choose rules that protect, first and foremost, rational, autonomous individuals.

Although Rawls argues for this conception as a conception of justice, others have tried to extend it to cover all of morality. For example, in The Animals Issue, Peter Carruthers argues for a conception of morality that is based largely on Rawls's work. Carruthers notes that if we do so extend Rawls's conception, animals will have no direct moral standing. Since the contractors are self-interested, but do not know who they are, they will accept rules that protect rational individuals. However, the contractors know enough about themselves to know that they are not animals. They will not adopt rules that give special protection to animals, therefore, since this would not further their self-interest. The result is that rational human beings will be directly protected, while animals will not.

e. Implications for the Treatment of Animals

If indirect theories are correct, then we are not required to take the interests of animals to be directly relevant to the assessment of our actions when we are deciding how to act. This does not mean, however, that we are not required to consider how our actions will affect animals at all. Just because something is not directly morally considerable does not imply that we can do whatever we want to it. For example, there are two straightforward ways in which restrictions regarding the proper treatment of animals can come into existence. Consider the duties we have towards private property. I cannot destroy your car if I desire to do so because it is your property, and by harming it I will thereby harm you. Also, I cannot go to the town square and destroy an old tree for fun since this may upset many people that care for the tree.

Likewise, duties with regard to animals can exist for these reasons. I cannot harm your pets because they belong to you, and by harming them I will thereby harm you. I also cannot harm animals in public simply for fun since doing so will upset many people, and I have a duty to not cause people undue distress. These are two straightforward ways in which indirect theories will generate duties with regard to animals.

There are two other ways that even stronger restrictions regarding the proper treatment of animals might be generated from indirect theories. First, both Immanuel Kant and Peter Carruthers argue that there can be more extensive indirect duties to animals. These duties extend not simply to the duty to refrain from harming the property of others and the duty to not offend animal lovers. Rather, we also have a duty to refrain from being cruel to them. Kant argues:

Our duties towards animals are merely indirect duties towards humanity. Animal nature has analogies to human nature, and by doing our duties to animals in respect of manifestations of human nature, we indirectly do our duty to humanity…. We can judge the heart of a man by his treatment of animals (Regan and Singer, 1989: 23-24).

Likewise, Carruthers writes:

Such acts [as torturing a cat for fun] are wrong because they are cruel. They betray an indifference to suffering that may manifest itself…with that person's dealings with other rational agents. So although the action may not infringe any rights…it remains wrong independently of its effect on any animal lover (Carruthers, 1992: 153-54).

So although we need not consider how our actions affect animals themselves, we do need to consider how our treatment of animals will affect our treatment of other human beings. If being cruel to an animal will make us more likely to be cruel to other human beings, we ought not be cruel to animals; if being grateful to animal will help us in being grateful to human beings then we ought to be grateful to animals.

Second, there may be an argument for vegetarianism that does not rely on considerations of the welfare of animals at all. Consider that for every pound of protein that we get from an animal source, we must feed the animals, on average, twenty-three pounds of vegetable protein. Many people on the planet today are dying of easily treatable diseases largely due to a diet that is below starvation levels. If it is possible to demonstrate that we have a duty to help alleviate the suffering of these human beings, then one possible way of achieving this duty is by refraining from eating meat. The vegetable protein that is used to feed the animals that wealthy countries eat could instead be used to feed the human beings that live in such deplorable conditions.

Of course, not all indirect theorists accept these results. However, the point to be stressed here is that even granting that animals have no direct moral status, we may have (possibly demanding) duties regarding their treatment.

f. Two Common Arguments Against Indirect Theories

Two common arguments against indirect theories have seemed compelling to many people. The first argument is The Argument from Marginal Cases; the second is an argument against the Kantian account of indirect duties to animals.

i. The Argument From Marginal Cases

The Argument from Marginal Cases is an argument that attempts to demonstrate that if animals do not have direct moral status, then neither do such human beings as infants, the senile, the severely cognitively disabled, and other such "marginal cases" of humanity. Since we believe that these sorts of human beings do have direct moral status, there must be something wrong with any theory that claims they do not. More formally, the argument is structured as follows:

  1. If we are justified in denying direct moral status to animals then we are justified in denying direct moral status to the marginal cases.
  2. We are not justified in denying direct moral status to the marginal cases.
  3. Therefore we are not justified denying direct moral status to animals.

The defense of premise (1) usually goes something like this. If being rational (or autonomous, or able to speak) is what permits us to deny direct moral status to animals, then we can likewise deny that status to any human that is not rational (or autonomous, able to speak, etc.). This line of reasoning works for almost every property that has been thought to warrant our denying direct moral status to animals. Since the marginal cases are beings whose abilities are equal to, if not less than, the abilities of animals, any reason to keep animals out of the class of beings with direct moral status will keep the marginal cases out as well.

There is one property that is immune to this line of argument, namely, the property of being human. Some who adhere to Worldview/Religious Views might reject this argument and maintain instead that it is simply "natural" for human beings to be above animals on any moral scale. However, if someone does so they must give up the claim that human beings are above animals due to the fact that human beings are more intelligent or rational than animals. It must be claimed instead that being human is, in itself, a morally relevant property. Few in recent times are willing to make that kind of a claim.

Another way to escape this line of argument is to deny the second premise (Cf. Frey, 1980; Francis and Norman, 1978). This may be done in a series of steps. First, it may be noted that there are very few human beings that are truly marginal. For example, infants, although not currently rational, have the potential to become rational. Perhaps they should not be counted as marginal for that reason. Likewise, the senile may have a direct moral status due to the desires they had when they were younger and rational. Once the actual number of marginal cases is appreciated, it is then claimed that it is not counter-intuitive to conclude that the remaining individuals do not have a direct moral status after all. Once again, however, few are willing to accept that conclusion. The fact that a severely cognitively disabled infant can feel pain seems to most to be a reason to refrain from harming the infant.

ii. Problems with Indirect Duties to Animals

Another argument against indirect theories begins with the intuition that there are some things that simply cannot be done to animals. For example, I am not permitted to torture my own cat for fun, even if no one else finds out about it. This intuition is one that any acceptable moral theory must be able to accommodate. The argument against indirect theories is that they cannot accommodate this intuition in a satisfying way.

Both Kant and Carruthers agree that my torturing my own cat for fun would be wrong. However, they believe it is wrong not because of the harm to the cat, but rather because of the effect this act will have on me. Many people have found this to be a very unsatisfying account of the duty. Robert Nozick labels the bad effects of such an act moral spillover, and asks:

Why should there be such a spillover? If it is, in itself, perfectly all right to do anything at all to animals for any reason whatsoever, then provided a person realizes the clear line between animals and persons and keeps it in mind as he acts, why should killing animals brutalize him and make him more likely to harm or kill persons (Nozick, 1974: 36)?

In other words, unless it is wrong in itself to harm the animal, it is hard to see why such an act would lead people to do other acts that are likewise wrong. If the indirect theorist does not have a better explanation for why it is wrong to torture a cat for fun, and as long as we firmly believe such actions are wrong, then we will be forced to admit that indirect theories are not acceptable.

Indirect theorists can, and have, responded to this line of argument in three ways. First, they could reject the claim that the indirect theorist's explanation of the duty is unsatisfactory. Second, they could offer an alternative explanation for why such actions as torturing a cat are wrong. Third, they could reject the claim that those sorts of acts are necessarily wrong.

2. Direct but Unequal Theories

Most people accept an account of the proper moral status of animals according to which the interests of animals count directly in the assessment of actions that affect them, but do not count for as much as the interests of human beings. Their defense requires two parts: a defense of the claim that the interests of animals count directly in the assessment of actions that affect them, and a defense of the claim that the interests of animals do not count for as much as the interests of human beings.

a. Why Animals have Direct Moral Status

The argument in support of the claim that animals have direct moral status is rather simple. It goes as follows:

  1. If a being is sentient then it has direct moral status.
  2. (Most) animals are sentient
  3. Therefore (most) animals have direct moral status.

"Sentience" refers to the capacity to experience episodes of positively or negatively valenced awareness. Examples of positively valenced episodes of awareness are pleasure, joy, elation, and contentment. Examples of negatively valenced episodes of awareness are pain, suffering, depression, and anxiety.

In support of premise (1), many argue that pain and pleasure are directly morally relevant, and that there is no reason to discount completely the pleasure or pain of any being. The argument from analogy is often used in support of premise (2) (see the discussion of this argument in section I, part C above). The argument from analogy is also used in answering the difficult question of exactly which animals are sentient. The general idea is that the justification for attributing sentience to a being grows stronger the more analogous it is to human beings.

People also commonly use the flaws of indirect theories as a reason to support the claim that animals have direct moral status. Those that believe both that the marginal cases have direct moral status and that indirect theories cannot answer the challenge of the Argument from Marginal Cases are led to support direct theories; those that believe both that such actions as the torture of one's own cat for fun are wrong and that indirect theories cannot explain why they are wrong are also led to direct theories.

b. Why Animals are not Equal to Human Beings

The usual manner of justifying the claim that animals are not equal to human beings is to point out that only humans have some property, and then argue that that property is what confers a full and equal moral status to human beings. Some philosophers have used the following claims on this strategy: (1) only human beings have rights; (2) only human beings are rational, autonomous, and self-conscious; (3) only human beings are able to act morally; and (4) only human beings are part of the moral community.

i. Only Human Beings Have Rights

On one common understanding of rights, only human beings have rights. On this conception of rights, if a being has a right then others have a duty to refrain from infringing that right; rights entail duties. An individual that has a right to something must be able to claim that thing for himself, where this entails being able to represent himself in his pursuit of the thing as a being that is legitimately pursuing the furtherance of his interests (Cf. McCloskey, 1979). Since animals are not capable of representing themselves in this way, they cannot have rights.

However, lacking rights does not entail lacking direct moral status; although rights entail duties it does not follow that duties entail rights. So although animals may have no rights, we may still have duties to them. The significance of having a right, however, is that rights act as "trumps" against the pursuit of utility. In other words, if an individual has a right to something, we are not permitted to infringe on that right simply because doing so will have better overall results. Our duties to those without rights can be trumped by considerations of the overall good. Although I have a duty to refrain from destroying your property, that duty can be trumped if I must destroy the property in order to save a life. Likewise, I am not permitted to harm animals without good reason; however, if greater overall results will come about from such harm, then it is justified to harm animals. This sort of reasoning has been used to justify such practices as experimentation that uses animals, raising animals for food, and using animals for our entertainment in such places as rodeos and zoos.

There are two points of contention with the above account of rights. First, it has been claimed that if human beings have rights, then animals will likewise have rights. For example, Joel Feinberg has argued that all is required in order for a being to have a right is that the being be capable of being represented as legitimately pursuing the furtherance of its interests (Feinberg, 1974). The claim that the being must be able to represent itself is too strong, thinks Feinberg, for such a requirement will exclude infants, the senile, and other marginal cases from the class of beings with rights. In other words, Feinberg invokes yet another instance of the Argument from Marginal Cases in order to support his position.

Second, it has been claimed that the very idea of rights needs to be jettisoned. There are two reasons for this. First, philosophers such as R. G. Frey have questioned the legitimacy of the very idea of rights, echoing Bentham's famous claim that rights are "nonsense on stilts" (Frey, 1980). Second, philosophers have argued that whether or not a being will have rights will depend essentially on whether or not it has some other lower-order property. For example, on the above conception of rights, whether a being will have a right or not will depend on whether it is able to represent itself as a being that is legitimately pursuing the furtherance of its interests. If that is what grounds rights, then what is needed is a discussion of the moral importance of that ability, along with a defense of the claim that it is an ability that animals lack. More generally, it has been argued that if we wish to deny animals rights and claim that only human beings have them, then we must focus not so much on rights, but rather on what grounds them. For this reason, much of the recent literature concerning animals and ethics focuses not so much on rights, but rather on whether or not animals have certain other properties, and whether the possession of those properties is a necessary condition for equal consideration (Cf. DeGrazia, 1999).

ii. Only Human Beings are Rational, Autonomous, and Self-Conscious

Some people argue that only rational, autonomous, and self-conscious beings deserve full and equal moral status; since only human beings are rational, autonomous, and self-conscious, it follows that only human beings deserve full and equal moral status. Once again, it is not claimed that we can do whatever we like to animals; rather, the fact that animals are sentient gives us reason to avoid causing them unnecessary pain and suffering. However, when the interests of animals and human beings conflict we are required to give greater weight to the interests of human beings. This also has been used to justify such practices as experimentation on animals, raising animals for food, and using animals in such places as zoos and rodeos.

The attributes of rationality, autonomy, and self-consciousness confer a full and equal moral status to those that possess them because these beings are the only ones capable of attaining certain values and goods; these values and goods are of a kind that outweigh the kinds of values and goods that non-rational, non-autonomous, and non-self-conscious beings are capable of attaining. For example, in order to achieve the kind of dignity and self-respect that human beings have, a being must be able to conceive of itself as one among many, and must be able to choose his actions rather than be led by blind instinct (Cf. Francis and Norman, 1978; Steinbock, 1978). Furthermore, the values of appreciating art, literature, and the goods that come with deep personal relationships all require one to be rational, autonomous, and self-conscious. These values, and others like them, are the highest values to us; they are what make our lives worth living. As John Stuart Mill wrote, "Few human creatures would consent to be changed into any of the lower animals for a promise of the fullest allowance of a beast's pleasures" (Mill, 1979). We find the lives of beings that can experience these goods to be more valuable, and hence deserving of more protection, than the lives of beings that cannot.

iii. Only Human Beings Can Act Morally

Another reason for giving stronger preference to the interests of human beings is that only human beings can act morally. This is considered to be important because beings that can act morally are required to sacrifice their interests for the sake of others. It follows that those that do sacrifice their good for the sake of others are owed greater concern from those that benefit from such sacrifices. Since animals cannot act morally, they will not sacrifice their own good for the sake of others, but will rather pursue their good even at the expense of others. That is why human beings should give the interests of other human beings greater weight than they do the interests of animals.

iv. Only Human Beings are Part of the Moral Community

Finally, some claim that membership in the moral community is necessary for full and equal moral status. The moral community is not defined in terms of the intrinsic properties that beings have, but is defined rather in terms of the important social relations that exist between beings. For example, human beings can communicate with each other in meaningful ways, can engage in economic, political, and familial relationships with each other, and can also develop deep personal relationships with each other. These kinds of relationships require the members of such relationships to extend greater concern to other members of these relationships than they do to others in order for the relationships to continue. Since these relationships are what constitute our lives and the value contained in them, we are required to give greater weight to the interests of human beings than we do to animals.

3. Moral Equality Theories

The final theories to discuss are the moral equality theories. On these theories, not only do animals have direct moral status, but they also have the same moral status as human beings. According to theorists of this kind, there can be no legitimate reason to place human beings and animals in different moral categories, and so whatever grounds our duties to human beings will likewise ground duties to animals.

a. Singer and the Principle of Equal Consideration of Interests

Peter Singer has been very influential in the debate concerning animals and ethics. The publication of his Animal Liberation marked the beginning of a growing and increasingly powerful movement in both the United States and Europe.

Singer attacks the views of those who wish to give the interests of animals less weight than the interests of human beings. He argues that if we attempt to extend such unequal consideration to the interests of animals, we will be forced to give unequal consideration to the interests of different human beings. However, doing this goes against the intuitively plausible and commonly accepted claim that all human beings are equal. Singer concludes that we must instead extend a principle of equal consideration of interests to animals as well. Singer describes that principle as follows:

The essence of the Principle of Equal Consideration of Interests is that we give equal weight in our moral deliberations to the like interests of all those affected by our actions (Singer, 1993: 21).

Singer defends this principle with two arguments. The first is a version of the Argument from Marginal Cases; the second is the Sophisticated Inegalitarian Argument.

i. The Argument from Marginal Cases (Again)

Singer's version of the Argument from Marginal Cases is slightly different from the version listed above. It runs as follows:

  1. In order to conclude that all and only human beings deserve a full and equal moral status (and therefore that no animals deserve a full and equal moral status), there must be some property P that all and only human beings have that can ground such a claim.
  2. Any P that only human beings have is a property that (some) human beings lack (e.g., the marginal cases).
  3. Any P that all human beings have is a property that (most) animals have as well.
  4. Therefore, there is no way to defend the claim that all and only human beings deserve a full and equal moral status.

Singer does not defend his first premise, but does not need to; the proponents of the view that all and only humans deserve a full and equal moral status rely on it themselves (see the discussion of Direct but Unequal Theories above). In support of the second premise, Singer asks us to consider exactly what properties only humans have that can ground such a strong moral status. Certain properties, such as being human, having human DNA, or walking upright do not seem to be the kind of properties that can ground this kind of status. For example, if we were to encounter alien life forms that did not have human DNA, but lived lives much like our own, we would not be justified in according these beings a weaker moral status simply because they were not human.

However, there are some properties which only human beings have which have seemed to many to be able to ground a full and equal moral status; for example, being rational, autonomous, or able to act morally have all been used to justify giving a stronger status to human beings than we do to animals. The problem with such a suggestion is that not all human beings have these properties. So if this is what grounds a full and equal moral status, it follows that not all human beings are equal after all.

If we try to ensure that we choose a property that all human beings do have that will be sufficient to ground a full and equal moral status, we seemed to be pushed towards choosing something such as being sentient, or being capable of experiencing pleasure and pain. Since the marginal cases have this property, they would be granted a full and equal moral status on this suggestion. However, if we choose a property of this kind, animals will likewise have a full and equal moral status since they too are sentient.

The attempt to grant all and only human beings a full and equal moral status does not work according to Singer. We must either conclude that not all human beings are equal, or we must conclude that not only human beings are equal. Singer suggests that the first option is too counter-intuitive to be acceptable; so we are forced to conclude that all animals are equal, human or otherwise.

ii. The Sophisticated Inegalitarian Argument

Another argument Singer employs to refute the claim that all and only human beings deserve a full and equal moral status focuses on the supposed moral relevance of such properties as rationality, autonomy, the ability to act morally, etc. Singer argues that if we were to rely on these sorts of properties as the basis of determining moral status, then we would justify a kind of discrimination against certain human beings that is structurally analogous to such practices as racism and sexism.

For example, the racist believes that all members of his race are more intelligent and rational than all of the members of other races, and thus assigns a greater moral status to the members of his race than he does do the members of other races. However, the racist is wrong in this factual judgment; it is not true that all members of any one race are smarter than all members of any other. Notice, however, that the mistake the racist is making is merely a factual mistake. His moral principle that assigns moral status on the basis of intelligence or rationality is not what has led him astray. Rather, it is simply his assessment of how intelligence or rationality is distributed among human beings that is mistaken.

If that were all that is wrong with racism and sexism, then a moral theory according to which we give extra consideration to the very smart and rational would be justified. In other words, we would be justified in becoming, not racists, but sophisticated inegalitarians. However, the sophisticated inegalitarian is just as morally suspect as the racist is. Therefore, it follows that the racist is not morally objectionable merely because of his views on how rationality and intelligence are distributed among human beings; rather he is morally objectionable because of the basis he uses to weigh the interests of different individuals. How intelligent, rational, etc., a being is cannot be the basis of his moral status; if it were, then the sophisticated inegalitarian would be on secure ground.

Notice that in order for this argument to succeed, it must target properties that admit of degrees. If someone argued that the basis of human equality rested on the possession of a property that did not admit of degrees, it would not follow that some human beings have that property to a stronger degree than others, and the sophisticated inegalitarian would not be justified. However, most of the properties that are used in order to support the claim that all and only human beings deserve a full and equal moral status are properties that do admit of degrees. Such properties as being human or having human DNA do not admit of degrees, but, as already mentioned, these properties do not seem to be capable of supporting such a moral status.

iii. Practical Implications

In order to implement the Principle of Equal Consideration of Interests in the practical sphere, we must be able to determine the interests of the beings that will be affected by our actions, and we must give similar interests similar weight. Singer concludes that animals can experience pain and suffering by relying on the argument from analogy (see the discussion of Cartesian Theories above). Since animals can experience pain and suffering, they have an interest in avoiding pain.

These facts require the immediate end to many of our practices according to Singer. For example, animals that are raised for food in factory farms live lives that are full of unimaginable pain and suffering (Singer devotes an entire chapter of his book to documenting these facts. He relies mainly on magazines published by the factory farm business for these facts). Although human beings do satisfy their interests by eating meat, Singer argues that the interests the animals have in avoiding this unimaginable pain and suffering is greater than the interests we have in eating food that tastes good. If we are to apply the Principle of Equal Consideration of Interests, we will be forced to cease raising animals in factory farms for food. A failure to do so is nothing other than speciesism, or giving preference to the interests of our own species merely because of they are of our species.

Singer does not unequivocally claim that we must not eat animals if we are to correctly apply the Principle of Equal Consideration of Interests. Whether we are required to refrain from painlessly killing animals will depend on whether animals have an interest in continuing to exist in the future. In order to have this interest, Singer believes that a being must be able to conceive of itself as existing into the future, and this requires a being to be self-conscious. Non-self-conscious beings are not harmed by their deaths, according to Singer, for they do not have an interest in continuing to exist into the future.

Singer argues that we might be able to justify killing these sorts of beings with The Replaceability Argument. On this line of thought, if we kill a non-self-conscious being that was living a good life, then we have lessened the overall amount of good in the world. This can be made up, however, by bringing another being into existence that can experience similar goods. In other words, non-self-conscious beings are replaceable: killing one can be justified if doing so is necessary to bring about the existence of another. Since the animals we rear for food would not exist if we did not eat them, it follows that killing these animals can be justified if the animals we rear for food live good lives. However, in order for this line of argumentation to justify killing animals, the animals must not only be non-self-conscious, but they must also live lives that are worth living, and their deaths must be painless. Singer expresses doubts that all of these conditions could be met, and unequivocally claims that they are not met by such places as factory farms.

Singer also condemns most experimentation in which animals are used. He first points out that many of the experiments performed using animal subjects do not have benefits for human beings that would outweigh the pain caused to the animals. For example, experiments used to test cosmetics or other non-necessary products for human beings cannot be justified if we use the Principle of Equal Consideration of Interests. Singer also condemns experiments that are aimed at preventing or curing human diseases. If we are prepared to use animal subjects for such experiments, then it would actually be better from a scientific point of view to use human subjects instead, for there would be no question of cross-species comparisons when interpreting the data. If we believe the benefits outweigh the harms, then instead of using animals we should instead use orphaned infants that are severely cognitively disabled. If we believe that such a suggestion is morally repugnant when human beings are to be used, but morally innocuous when animals are to be used, then we are guilty of speciesism.

Likewise, hunting for sport, using animals in rodeos, keeping animals confined in zoos wherein they are not able to engage in their natural activities are all condemned by the use of the Principle of the Equal Consideration of Interests.

b. Regan and Animal Rights

Tom Regan's seminal work, The Case for Animal Rights, is one of the most influential works on the topic of animals and ethics. Regan argues for the claim that animals have rights in just the same way that human beings do. Regan believes it is a mistake to claim that animals have an indirect moral status or an unequal status, and to then infer that animals cannot have any rights. He also thinks it is a mistake to ground an equal moral status on Utilitarian grounds, as Singer attempts to do. According to Regan, we must conclude that animals have the same moral status as human beings; furthermore, that moral status is grounded on rights, not on Utilitarian principles.

Regan argues for his case by relying on the concept of inherent value. According to Regan, any being that is a subject-of-a-life is a being that has inherent value. A being that has inherent value is a being towards which we must show respect; in order to show respect to such a being, we cannot use it merely as a means to our ends. Instead, each such being must be treated as an end in itself. In other words, a being with inherent value has rights, and these rights act as trumps against the promotion of the overall good.

Regan relies on a version of the Argument from Marginal Cases in arguing for this conclusion. He begins by asking what grounds human rights. He rejects robust views that claim that a being must be capable of representing itself as legitimately pursuing the furtherance of its interests on the grounds that this conception of rights implies that the marginal cases of humanity do not have rights. However, since we think that these beings do have moral rights there must be some other property that grounds these rights. According to Regan, the only property that is common to both normal adult human beings and the marginal cases is the property of being a subject-of-a-life. A being that is a subject-of-a-life will:

have beliefs and desires; perception, memory, and a sense of the future, including their own future; an emotional life together with feelings of pleasure and pain; preference- and welfare-interests; the ability to initiate action in pursuit of their desires and goals; a psychological identity over time; and an individual welfare in the sense that their experiential life fares well or ill for them, logically independently of their utility for others, and logically independently of their being the object of anyone else's interests (Regan, 1983: 243).

This property is one that all of the human beings that we think deserve rights have; however, it is a property that many animals (especially mammals) have as well. So if these marginal cases of humanity deserve rights, then so do these animals.

Although this position may seem quite similar to Singer's position (see section III, part A above), Regan is careful to point to what he perceives to be the flaws of Singer's Utilitarian theory. According to Singer, we are required to count every similar interest equally in our deliberation. However, by doing this we are focusing on the wrong thing, Regan claims. What matters is the individual that has the interest, not the interest itself. By focusing on interests themselves, Utilitarianism will license the most horrendous actions. For example, if it were possible to satisfy more interests by performing experiments on human beings, then that is what we should do on Utilitarian grounds. However, Regan believes this is clearly unacceptable: any being with inherent value cannot be used merely as a means.

This does not mean that Regan takes rights to be absolute. When the rights of different individuals conflict, then someone's rights must be overriden. Regan argues that in these sorts of cases we must try to minimize the rights that are overriden. However, we are not permitted to override someone's rights just because doing so will make everyone better off; in this kind of case we are sacrificing rights for utility, which is never permissible on Regan's view.

Given these considerations, Regan concludes that we must radically alter the ways in which we treat animals. When we raise animals for food, regardless of how they are treated and how they are killed, we are using them as a means to our ends and not treating them as ends in themselves. Thus, we may not raise animals for food. Likewise, when we experiment on animals in order to advance human science, we are using animals merely as a means to our ends. Similar thoughts apply to the use of animals in rodeos and the hunting of animals.

See also Animal Ethics.

4. References and Further Reading.

a. Anthologies

  • Miller, H. and W. Miller, eds. Ethics and Animals (Clifton, NJ: Humana Press, 1983).
  • Regan, T. and P. Singer, eds. Animal Rights and Human Obligations 2/e (Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice Hall, 1989).
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b. Monographs

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c. Articles

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Author Information

Scott D. Wilson
Wright State University
U. S. A.


This article gives an overview of the moral and legal aspects of abortion and evaluates the most important arguments. The central moral aspect concerns whether there is any morally relevant point during the biological process of the development of the fetus from its beginning as a unicellular zygote to birth itself that may justify not having an abortion after that point. Leading candidates for the morally relevant point are: the onset of movement, consciousness, the ability to feel pain, and viability. The central legal aspect of the abortion conflict is whether fetuses have a basic legal right to live, or, at least, a claim to live. The most important argument with regard to this conflict is the potentiality argument, which turns on whether the fetus is potentially a human person and thus should be protected. The question of personhood depends on both empirical findings and moral claims.

The article ends with an evaluation of a pragmatic account. According to this account, one has to examine the different kinds of reasons for abortion in a particular case to decide about the reasonableness of the justification given. Take the example of a young, raped woman. The account suggests that it would seem cruel and callous to force her to give birth to "her" child. So, if  this pragmatic account is correct, some abortions may be morally justifiable whereas other abortions may be morally reprehensible.

Table of Contents

  1. Preliminary Distinctions
    1. Three Views on Abortion
    2. The Standard Argument
    3. The Modified Standard Argument
  2. Personhood
  3. Moral Aspects of the Abortion Conflict
    1. Moral Rights
    2. At Birth
    3. Viability
    4. First Movement
    5. Consciousness and the Ability to Feel Pain
    6. Unicellular Zygote
    7. Thomson and the Argument of The Sickly Violinist
  4. Legal Aspects of the Abortion Conflict
    1. The Account of Quasi-Rights
    2. The Argument of Potentiality
  5. A Pragmatic Account
    1. First Order Reasons
      1. Rape
      2. Endangerment of the Woman’s Life
      3. Serious Mentally or Physically Disabled Fetuses
    2. Second Order Reasons
      1. A Journey to Europe
      2. Financial and Social Reasons
    3. First Order Reasons vs. Second Order Reasons
  6. Public Policy and Abortion
  7. Clinical Ethics Consultation and Abortion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Preliminary Distinctions

One of the most important issues in biomedical ethics is the controversy surrounding abortion. This controversy has a long history and is still heavily discussed among researchers and the public—both in terms of morality and in terms of legality. The following basic questions may characterize the subject in more detail: Is abortion morally justifiable? Does the fetus (embryo, conceptus, and zygote) have any moral and/or legal rights? Is the fetus a human person and, thus, should be protected? What are the criteria for being a person? Is there any morally relevant break along the biological process of development from the unicellular zygote to birth? This list of questions is not meant to be exhaustive, but it describes the issues of the following analysis.

a. Three Views on Abortion

There are three main views: first, the extreme conservative view (held by the Catholic Church); second, the extreme liberal view (held by Singer); and third, moderate views which lie between both extremes. Some opponents (anti-abortionists, pro-life activists) holding the extreme view, argue that human personhood begins from the unicellular zygote and thus – according to the religious stance – one should not have an abortion by virtue of the imago dei of the human being (for example, Schwarz 1990). To have an abortion would be, by definition, homicide. The extreme liberal view is held by proponents (abortionists). They claim that human personhood begins immediately after birth or a bit later (Singer). Thus, they consider the relevant date is at birth or a short time later (say, one month). The proponents of the moderate views argue that there is a morally relevant break in the biological process of development - from the unicellular zygote to birth - which determines the justifiability and non-justifiability of having an abortion. According to them, there is a gradual process from being a fetus to being an infant where the fetus is not a human being but a human offspring with a different moral status.

The advantage of the extreme conservative view is the fact that it defines human personhood from the beginning of life (the unicellular zygote); there is no slippery slope. However, it seems implausible to say that the zygote is a human person. The advantage of the extreme liberal view is that its main claim is supported by a common philosophical usage of the notion "personhood" and thus seems more sound than the extreme conservative view because the offspring is far more developed; as the unicellular zygote. This view also faces severe problems; for example, it is not at all clear where the morally relevant difference is between the fetus five minutes before birth and a just born offspring. Some moderate views have commonsense plausibility especially when it is argued that there are significant differences between the developmental stages. The fact that they also claim for a break in the biological process, which is morally relevant, seems to be a relapse into old and unjustified habits. As Gillespie stresses in his article "Abortion and Human Rights" (1984, 94-102) there is no morally relevant break in the biological process of development. But, in fact, there are differences, which make a comparative basis possible without having to solve the problem of drawing a line. How should one decide?

b. The Standard Argument

The standard argument is the following practical syllogism:

  1. The killing of human beings is prohibited.
  2. A fetus is a human being.
  3. The killing of fetuses is prohibited.

Hence, abortion is not allowed since homicide is prohibited. It seems obvious to question the result of the practical syllogism since one is able to argue against both premises. First, there are possible situations where the first premise could be questioned by noting, for example that killing in self-defense is not prohibited. Second, the second premise could also be questioned since it is not at all clear whether fetuses are human beings in the sense of being persons, although they are of course human beings in the sense of being members of the species of homo sapiens. Consecutively, one would deny that fetuses are persons but admit that a young two year old child may be a person. Although, in the end, it may be difficult to claim that every human being is a person. For example, people with severe mental handicaps or disorder seem not to have personhood. That is, if personhood is defined with regard to specific criteria like the capacity to reason, or to have consciousness, self-consciousness, or rationality, some people might be excluded. But, in fact, this does not mean that people with severe mental handicaps who lack personhood can be killed. Even when rights are tied to the notion of personhood, it is clearly prohibited to kill disabled people. Norbert Hoerster, a well-known German philosopher, claims that fetuses with severe handicaps can be - like all other fetuses - aborted, as born human beings with severe handicaps they have to be protected and respected like all other human beings, too (1995, 159).

c. The Modified Standard Argument

However, it seems appropriate to modify the standard argument and to use a more sophisticated version. Replace the notion "human being" with "human life form." The new practical syllogism is:

  1. The killing of human life forms is prohibited.
  2. A fetus is a human life form.
  3. The killing of fetuses is prohibited.

The objection against the first premise of the standard argument still holds for the new more sophisticated version. But, the second modified premise is much stronger than the previous one because one has to determine what a human life form really is. Is a fetus a human life form? But, even if the fetus is a human life form, it does not necessarily follow that it should be protected by that fact, simpliciter. The fetus may be a human life form but it hardly seems to be a person (in the ordinary sense of the notion) and thus has no corresponding basic right to live. However, as already stated, this kind of talk seems to go astray because the criteria for personhood may be suitable for just-borns but not appropriate for fetuses, embryos, or unicellular zygotes, like some biological (human being), psychological (self-consciousness), rational (ability to reasoning), social (sympathy/love), or legal (being a human life form with rights) criteria may indicate (for example, Jane English 1984). Jane English persuasively argues in "Abortion and the Concept of a Person" that even if the fetus is a person, abortion may be justifiable in many cases, and if the fetus is no person, the killing of fetuses may be wrong in many cases.

2. Personhood

What does it mean to claim that a human life form is a person? This is an important issue since the ascription of rights is at stake. I previously stated that it is unsound to say that a fetus is a person or has personhood since it lacks, at least, rationality and self-consciousness. It follows that not every human being is also a person according to the legal sense, and, thus, also lacks moral rights (extreme case). The fetus is by virtue of his genetic code a human life form but this does not mean that this would be sufficient to grant it legal and moral rights. Nothing follows from being a human life form by virtue of one’s genes, especially not that one is able to derive legal or moral rights from this very fact (for example, speciesism). Is a human person exclusively defined by her membership of the species Homo sapiens sapiens and thus should be protected? To accept this line of argumentation would entail the commitment of the existence of normative empirical features. It seems premature to derive the prohibition to kill a life form from the bare fact of its genetic feature - including the human life form - unless one argues that human beings do have the basic interest of protecting their offspring. Is a human life form a moral entity? This seems to be a good approach. The argument runs as follows: It seems plausible to claim that human beings create values and, if they have the basic interest of protecting their offspring, human beings may establish a certain morality by which they can argue, for example, for the prohibition of abortions. The moral judgment can be enforced through legal norms (see below).

To be more precise about the assumption of the existence or non-existence of normative, empirical features: Critics of the view to tie the right to live and the biological category of being a human being claim that the protagonists effect the is-ought fallacy. Why is it unsound to take the bare fact of being a member of the biological species Homo sapiens as a solid basis for granting the right to live? The linkage seems only justified when there are sound factual reasons. If there are none, the whole line of reasoning would "hang in the air" so that one could also easily argue for the right to live for cats and dogs. Only factual relevant features may be important for the linkage. What could these relevant features look like?

Jane English presents in her article "Abortion and the Concept of a Person" several features of personhood which characterize the human person. Her notion of personhood can be grouped into five sectors (English 1984, pp. 152): (i) the biological sector (being a human being, having extremities, eating and sleeping); (ii) the psychological sector (perception, emotions, wishes and interests, ability to communicate, ability to make use of tools, self-consciousness); (iii) the rational sector (reasoning, ability to make generalizations, to make plans, learning from experience); (iv) the social sector (to belong to different groups, other people, sympathy and love); and (v) the legal sector (to be a legal addressee, ability to make contracts, to be a citizen). According to English, it is not necessary for a human life form to comply with all five sectors and different aspects to count as a person. A fetus lies right in the penumbra where the concept of personhood is hard to apply. There is no core of necessary and sufficient features that could be ascribed to a human life form in order to be sure that these features constitute a person (English 1984, 153).

Mary Anne Warren claims that a human life form should qualify as a person when, at least, some of the following aspects (especially i-iii) are at stake: (i) consciousness and the ability to feel pain; (ii) reasoning; (iii) a self-motivated activity; (iv) ability to communicate; and (v) the existence of a self-concept (for example, individual, racial) and self-consciousness (Warren 1984, 110-113). Warren argues that the fetus is no person since it lacks the criteria of personhood and, thus, an abortion is justified.

The aim is not to give an airtight definition of the concept of personhood. The main question is whether a fetus could qualify as a person. The following can be stated: The fetus is a human offspring but is not a legal, social, and rational person in the ordinary sense of the notions. Some aspects of the psychological sector for example, the ability to feel and perceive can be ascribed to the fetus but not to the embryo, conceptus, or the (unicellular) zygote. It seems implausible to say that a fetus (or embryo, conceptus, zygote) is a person, unless one additionally claims that the genetic code of the fetus is a sufficient condition. However, this does not mean, in the end, that one could always justify an abortion. It only shows that the fetus could hardly be seen as a human person.

It is hard to keep the legal and moral aspects of the conflict of abortion apart. There are overlaps which are due to the nature of things since legal considerations are based on the ethical realm. This can also be seen according to the notion person. What a person is is not a legal question but a question which is to be decided within a specific ethics. If one characterizes the notion of a person along some criteria, then the question of which criteria are suitable or not will be discussed with regard to a specific moral approach (for example, Kantianism, utilitarianism, virtue ethics). The relevant criteria, in turn, may come from different areas like the psychological, rational, or social sphere. If the criteria are settled, this influences the legal sector because the ascription of legal rights – especially the right to live in the abortion debate – is tied to persons and respectively to the concept of personhood.

3. Moral Aspects of the Abortion Conflict

The main question with regard to the moral sphere concerns identification of the right developmental point of the fetus (or the embryo, conceptus, zygote) to decide which break may morally justify an abortion or not (proponents of the moderate view and the extreme liberal view claim that there is such a break). The main arguments in the debate will be evaluated in the following. Before we analyze the arguments, it is necessary to say something about moral rights.

a. Moral Rights

Some authors claim that the talk of moral rights and moral obligations is an old never-ending tale. There are no "moral rights" or "moral obligations" per se; at least, in the sense that there are also moral rights and moral obligations apart from legal rights and legal obligations. There is no higher ethical authority which may enforce a specific moral demand. Rights and obligations rest on law. According to ethics, one should better say "moral agreements" (for example, Gauthier). The proponents claim that moral agreements do have a similar status to legal rights and legal obligations but stress that no person has an enforceable demand to have her moral rights prevail over others. The suitability is the essential aspect of the metaphysics of rights and obligations. Only the formal constraint establishes rights and obligations within a given society (for example, Hobbes); the informal constraint within a given society - though it may be stronger – is not able to do so. Without a court of first instance there are no rights and obligations. Only by using the legal system is one able to establish specific moral rights and specific moral obligations. Those authors claim that there are no absolute moral rights and moral obligations which are universally valid; moral agreements are always subjective and relative. Hence, there are also no (absolute) moral rights which the fetus (embryo, conceptus, or zygote) may call for. The only solution may be that the survival of the fetus rests on the will of the human beings in a given moral society. According to their view, it is only plausible to argue that an abortion is morally reprehensible if the people in a given society do have a common interest not to abort and make a moral agreement which is enforced by law.

b. At Birth

Proponents of the liberal view contend that the morally significant break in the biological development of the fetus is at birth. This means that it is morally permitted to have an abortion before birth and morally prohibited to kill the offspring after birth. The objection against this view is simple because there seems to be no morally relevant difference between a short time (say five minutes) before birth and after it. Factually, the only biological difference is the physical separation of the fetus from the mother. However it seems unsound to interpret this as the morally significant difference; the bare evidence with regard to the visibility of the offspring and the physical separation (that is, the offspring is no longer dependent on the woman’s body) seems insufficient.

c. Viability

Proponents of the moderate view often claim that the viability criterion is a hot candidate for a morally significant break because the dependence of the nonviable fetus on the pregnant woman gives her the right to make a decision about having an abortion. The aspect of dependence is insufficient in order to determine the viability as a possible break. Take the following counter-example: A son and his aged mother who is nonviable without the intensive care of her son; the son has no right to let his mother die by virtue of her given dependence. However, one may object that there is a difference between "needing someone to care for you" and "needing to live off a particular person’s body." Furthermore, one may stress that the nonviable and the viable fetus both are potential human adults. But as we will see below the argument of potentiality is flawed since it is unclear how actual rights could be derived from the bare potentiality of having such rights at a later time. Hence, both types of fetuses cannot make claim for a right. There is also another objection that cannot be rebutted: the viability of the fetus regarding the particular level of medical technology. On the one hand, there is a temporal relativity according to medical technology. The understanding of what constitutes the viability of the fetus has developed over time according to the technical level of embryology in the last centuries and decades. Today, artificial viability allows physicians to rescue many premature infants who would have previously died. On the other hand, there exists a local relativity according to the availability of medical supplies in and within countries which determines whether the life of a premature infant will be saved. The medical supply may vary greatly. Consequently, it seems inappropriate to claim that viability as such should be regarded as a significant break by being a general moral justification against abortions.

d. First Movement

The first movement of the fetus is sometimes regarded as a significant break because proponents stress its deeper meaning which usually rests on religious or non-religious considerations. Formerly the Catholic Church maintained that the first movement of the fetus shows that it is the breathing of life into the human body (animation) which separates the human fetus from animals. This line of thinking is out-of-date and the Catholic Church no longer uses it. Another point is that the first movement of the fetus that women experience is irrelevant since the real first movement of the fetus is much earlier. Ultrasonic testing shows that the real first movement of the fetus is somewhere between the 6th and 9th week. But even if one considers the real first movement problems may arise. The physical ability to move is morally irrelevant. One counter-example: What about an adult human being who is quadriplegic and is unable to move? It seems out of the question to kill such people and to justify the killing by claiming that people who are disabled and simply lack the ability to move are, therewith, at other people’s disposal.

e. Consciousness and the Ability to Feel Pain

In general, proponents of moderate views believe that consciousness and the ability to feel pain will develop after about six months. However the first brain activities are discernable after the seventh week so that it is possible to conclude that the fetus may feel pain after this date. In this respect, the ability to suffer is decisive for acknowledging a morally significant break. One may object to this claim, that the proponents of this view redefine the empirical feature of "the ability to suffer" as a normative feature (is-ought fallacy). It is logically unsound to conclude from the bare fact that the fetus feels pain that it is morally reprehensible or morally prohibited per se to abort the fetus.

f. Unicellular Zygote

Proponents of the extreme conservative view claim that the morally significant break in the biological development of the fetus is given with the unicellular human zygote. They argue that the unicellular zygote is a human person, and thus, it is prohibited to have an abortion because one kills a human being (for example, Schwarz).

The extreme conservative proponents argue that biological development from the fetus to a human being is an incremental process which leaves no room for a morally significant break (liberals deny this line of thinking). If there is no morally significant break, then the fetus has the same high status of a newborn, or the newborn has the same low status of the fetus.

To many opponents of the "extreme" conservative position, it seems questionable to claim that a unicellular zygote is a person. At best, one may maintain that the zygote will potentially develop into a human being. Except the potentiality argument is flawed since it is impossible to derive current rights from the potential ability of having rights at a later time. Opponents (for example, Gert) also object to any attempt to base conclusions on religious considerations that they believe cannot stand up to rational criticism. For these reasons, they argue that the conservative view should be rejected.

g. Thomson and the Argument of The Sickly Violinist

Judith Jarvis Thomson presents an interesting case in her landmark article "A Defense of Abortion" (1971) in order to show that, even if the fetus has a right to live, one is still able to justify an abortion for reasons of a woman’s right to live/integrity/privacy. Thomson’s famous example is that of the sickly violinist: You awake one morning to find that you have been kidnapped by a society of music lovers in order to help a violinist who is unable to live on his own by virtue of his ill-health. He has been attached to your kidneys because you alone have the only blood type to keep him alive. You are faced with a moral dilemma because the violinist has a right to live by being a member of the human race; there seems to be no possibility to unplug him without violating this right and thus killing him. However, if you leave him attached to you, you are unable to move for months, although you did not give him the right to use your body in such a way (Thomson 1984, 174-175).

First, Thomson claims that the right to live does not include the right to be given the means necessary for survival. If the right to live entails the right to those means, one is not justified in preventing the violinist from the on-going use of one’s kidneys. The right to the on-going use of the kidneys necessarily implies that the violinist’s right to his means for survival always trumps the right to another person’s body. Thomson refuses this and claims that "the fact that for continued life that violinist needs the continued use of your kidneys does not establish that he has a right to be given the continued use of your kidneys" (Thomson 1984, 179). She argues that everybody has a right of how his own body is used. That is, the violinist has no right to use another person’s body without her permission. Therefore, one is morally justified in not giving the violinist the use of one’s own kidneys.

Second, Thomson contends that the right to live does not include the right not to be killed. If the violinist has the right not to be killed, then another person is not justified in removing the plug from her kidneys although the violinist has no right to their use. According to Thomson, the violinist has no right to another person’s body and hence one cannot be unjust in unplugging him: "You surely are not being unjust to him, for you gave him no right to use your kidneys, and no one else can have given him any such right" (Thomson 1984, 180). If one is not unjust in unplugging oneself from him, and he has no right to the use of another person’s body, then it cannot be wrong, although the result of the action is that the violinist will be killed.

4. Legal Aspects of the Abortion Conflict

What is the legal status of the fetus (embryo, conceptus, and zygote)? Before the question is answered, one should pay some attention to the issue of the genesis of a legal system. Which ontological status do legal rights have? Where do they come from? Usually we accept the idea that legal rights do not "fall from the blue sky" but are made by human beings. Other conceptions which had been provided in the history of human kind are:

  1. rights rest on God's will;
  2. rights rest on the strongest person; or
  3. rights rest on a specific human feature like a person’s wisdom or age.

However, let us take the following description for granted: There is a legal community in which the members are legal entities with (legal) claims and legal addressees with (legal) obligations. If someone refuses the addressee’s legal obligation within such a system, the legal entity has the right to call the legal instance in order to let his right be enforced. The main question is whether the fetus (or the embryo, conceptus, zygote) is a legal person with a basic right to live or not and, furthermore, whether there will be a conflict of legal norms, that is a conflict between the fetus’ right to live and the right of self-determination of the pregnant woman (principle of autonomy). Is the fetus a legal entity or not?

a. The Account of Quasi-Rights

It was previously stated that the fetus as such is no person and that it seems unsound to claim that fetuses are persons in the ordinary sense of the notion. If rights are tied to the notion of personhood, then it seems appropriate to say that fetuses do not have any legal rights. One can object that animals of higher consciousness (or even plants, see Korsgaard 1996, 156) have some "rights" or quasi-rights because it is prohibited to kill them without good reason (killing great apes and dolphins for fun is prohibited in most countries). Their "right" not to be killed is based on the people’s will and their basic interest not to kill higher developed animals for fun. But, it would be wrong to assume that those animals are legal entities with "full" rights, or that they have only "half" rights. Thus, it seems reasonable to say that animals have "quasi-rights." There is a parallel between the so-called right of the fetus and the quasi-rights of some animals: both are not persons in the normal sense of the notion but it would cause us great discomfort to offer them no protection and to deliver them to the vagaries of the people. According to this line of argument, it seems sound to claim that fetuses also have quasi-rights. It does not follow that the quasi-rights of the fetuses and the quasi-rights of the animals are identical; people would normally stress that the quasi-rights of fetuses are of more importance than that of animals.

However, there are some basic rights of the pregnant woman, for example, the right of self-determination, the right of privacy, the right of physical integrity, and the right to live. On the other hand, there is the existential quasi-right of the fetus, that is, the quasi-right to live. If the presumption is right that legal rights are tied to the notion of personhood and that there is a difference between rights and quasi-rights, then it seems right that the fetus has no legal right but "just" a quasi-right to live. If this is the case, what about the relation between the existential quasi-right of the fetus and the basic legal rights of the pregnant woman? The answer seems obvious: quasi-rights cannot trump full legal rights. The fetus has a different legal status that is based on a different moral status (see above). On this view there is no legal conflict of rights.

b. The Argument of Potentiality

Another important point in the debate about the ascription of legal rights to the fetus is the topic of potential rights. Joel Feinberg discusses this point in his famous article "Potentiality, Development, and Rights" (1984, 145-151) and claims that the thesis that actual rights can be derived from the potential ability of having such rights is logically flawed because one is only able to derive potential rights from a potential ability of having rights. Feinberg maintains that there may be cases where it is illegal or wrong to have an abortion even when the fetus does not have any rights or is not yet a moral person. To illustrate his main argument – that rights do not rest on the potential ability of having them – Feinberg considers Stanley Benn’s argument which I slightly modified:

If person X is President of the USA and thus is Commander in Chief of the army, then person X had the potential ability to become the President of the USA and Commander in Chief of the army in the years before his rule.

But, it does not follow that:

The person X has the authority to command the army as potential President of the USA.

Thus, it seems incorrect to derive actual rights from the bare potential ability to have legal rights at a later time. It should be added that Benn - despite his criticism on the argument of potential rights - also claims that there are valid considerations which do not refer to the talk of rights and may provide plausible reasons against infanticide and late abortions even when fetuses and newborns are lawless beings with no personhood.

5. A Pragmatic Account

There is always a chance that women get pregnant when they have sex with their (heterosexual) partners. There is not a 100% certainty of not getting pregnant under "normal circumstances"; there is always a very small chance even by using contraception to get pregnant. However, what does the sphere of decisions look like? A pregnancy is either deliberate or not. If the woman gets deliberately pregnant, then both partners (respectively the pregnant woman) may decide to have a baby or to have an abortion. In the case of having an abortion there may be good reasons for having an abortion with regard to serious health problems, for example, a (seriously) disabled fetus or the endangerment of the woman’s life. Less good reasons seem to be: vacation, career prospects, or financial and social grievances. If the pregnancy is not deliberate, it is either self-caused in the sense that the partners knew about the consequences of sexual intercourses and the contraception malfunctioned or it is not self-caused in the sense of being forced to have sex (rape). In both cases the fetus may be aborted or not. The interesting question concerns the reasons given for the justification of having an abortion.

There are at least two different kinds of reasons or justifications: The first group will be called "first order reasons"; the second "second order reasons." First order reasons are reasons of justifications which may plausibly justify an abortion, for example, (i) rape, (ii) endangerment of the woman’s life, and (iii) a serious mentally or physically disabled fetus. Second order reasons are reasons of justifications which are, in comparison to first order reasons, less suitable in providing a strong justification for abortion, for example, (i) a journey, (ii) career prospects, (iii) by virtue of financial or social grievances.

a. First Order Reasons

i. Rape

It would be cruel and callous to force the pregnant woman who had been raped to give birth to a child. Judith Jarvis Thomson maintains in her article "A Defense of Abortion" that the right to live does not include the right to make use of a foreign body even if this means having the fetus aborted (Thomson 1984, pp. 174 and pp. 177). Both the fetus and the raped woman are "innocent," but this does not change "the fact" that the fetus has any rights. It seems obvious in this case that the raped woman has a right to abort. Forcing her not to abort is to remind her of the rape day-by-day which would be a serious mental strain and should not be enforced by law or morally condemned.

However, this assumption would be premature from John Noonan’s viewpoint according to his article "An Almost Absolute Value in History" (Noonan 1970, 51-59). He claims that

the fetus as human [is] a neighbor; his life [has] parity with one’s own […] [which] could be put in humanistic as well as theological terms: do not injure your fellow man without reasons. In these terms, once the humanity of the fetus is perceived, abortion is never right except in self-defense. When life must be taken to save life, reason alone cannot say that a mother must prefer a child’s life to her own. With this exception, now of great rarity, abortion violates the rational humanist tenet of the equality of human lives.

Hence, the woman has no right to abort the fetus even if she had been raped and got pregnant against her will. This is the consequence of Noonan’s claim since he only permits having an abortion in self-defense while Thomson argues that women, in general, have a right to abort the fetus when the fetus is conceived as an intruder (for example, due to rape). But, it remains unclear what Noonan means by "self-defense." At the end of his article he states that "self-sacrifice carried to the point of death seemed in extreme situations not without meaning. In the less extreme cases, preference for one’s own interests to the life of another seemed to express cruelty or selfishness irreconcilable with the demands of love" (Noonan 1970). On this view, even in the standard case of self-defense -- for example, either the woman’s life or the life of the fetus -- the pregnant woman’s death would not be inappropriate and in less extreme cases the raped woman would express cruelty or selfishness when she aborts the fetus -- a judgment not all people would agree with.

ii. Endangerment of the Woman’s Life

Furthermore, there is no good reason to proceed with a pregnancy when the woman’s life is in serious danger. Potential life should not be more valued then actual life. Of course, it is desirable to do everything possible to rescue both but it should be clear that the woman’s life "counts more" in this situation. To force her at the risk of her life means to force her to give up her right of self-defense and her right to live. There seems to be no good reason to suspend her basic right of self-defense.

iii. Serious Mentally or Physically Disabled Fetuses

It is hard to say when exactly a fetus is seriously mentally or physically disabled because this hot issue raises the vital question of whether the future life of the disabled fetus is regarded as worth living (problem of relativity). Hence, there are simple cases and, of course, borderline cases which lie in the penumbra and are hard to evaluate. Among the simple cases take the following example: Imagine a human torso lacking arms and legs that will never develop mental abilities like self-consciousness, the ability to communicate, or the ability to reason. It seems quite obvious to some people that such a life is not worth living. But what about the high number of borderline cases? Either parents are not entitled to have a healthy and strong offspring, nor are the offspring entitled to become healthy and strong. Society should not force people to give birth to seriously disabled fetuses or morally worse to force mothers who are willing to give birth to a disabled fetus to have an abortion (for example, Nazi Germany). It seems clear that a rather small handicap of the fetus is not a good reason to abort it.

Often radical groups of disabled persons claim that, if other people hold the view that it is all right to abort fetuses with (serious) genetic handicaps, the same people therewith deny the basic right to live of disabled adults with serious handicaps (see Singer debate). This objection is unreasonable since fetuses in contrast to adult human beings have no basic interest in continuing to live their lives. Disabled fetuses may be aborted like other fetuses, disabled (adult) human persons have to be respected like other people.

b. Second Order Reasons

i. A Journey to Europe

With regard to the reasons of justification according to the second group, there is a specific view which is based on the argument that it is the decision of the woman to have an abortion or not.

There is a related view that rests on the assumption of the pregnant woman who claims that the fetus is a part of her body like a limb so that she has the right to do what ever she wants to do with the fetus. The argument is wrong. The fetus is certainly not a simple part of the pregnant woman but, rather, a dependent organism that relies on the woman.

The following example, the journey to Europe from North America, is based on the feminist argument but it is somewhat different in stressing another point in the line of argumentation: A young woman is pregnant in the seventh month and decides to make a journey to Europe for a sight-seeing tour. Her pregnancy is an obstacle to this and she decides to have an abortion. She justifies her decision by claiming that it will be possible for her to get pregnant whenever she wants but she is only able to make the journey now by virtue of her present career prospects. What can be said of her decision? Most authors may feel a deep discomfort not to morally condemn the action of the woman or not to reproach her for her decision for different reasons. But, there seems only two possible answers which may count as a valid basis for morally blaming the woman for her decision: First, if the young woman lives in a moral community where all members hold the view that it is immoral to have an abortion with regard to the reason given, then her action may be morally reprehensible. Furthermore, if the (moral) agreement is enforced by law, the woman also violated the particular law for which she has to take charge of. Second, one could also blame her for not showing compassion for her potential child. People may think that she is a callous person since she prefers to make the journey to Europe instead of giving birth to her almost born child (seventh month). If the appeal to her mercy fails, one will certainly be touched by her "strange" and "inappropriate" action. However, the community would likely put some informal pressure on the pregnant woman to influence her decision not to have an abortion. But some people may still contend that this social pressure will not change anything about the fact that the fetus has no basic right to live while claiming that the woman’s decision is elusive.

ii. Financial and Social Reasons

A woman got pregnant (not deliberately) and wants to have an abortion by virtue of her bad financial and social background because she fears that she will be unable to offer the child an appropriate life perspective. In this case, the community should do everything possible to assist the woman if she wants to give birth to her child. Or, some may argue, that society should offer to take care of her child in special homes with other children or to look for other families who are willing to house another child. According to this line of thinking, people may claim that the financial or social background should not be decisive for having an abortion if there is a true chance for help.

c. First Order Reasons vs. Second Order Reasons

There is a difference between the first order reasons and the second order reasons. We already saw that the first order reasons are able to justify an abortion while the second order reasons are less able to do so. That is because people think that the second order reasons are weaker than the reasons of the first group. It seems that the human ability to show compassion for the fetus is responsible for our willingness to limit the woman’s basic right of autonomy where her reasons are too elusive. However, one may state that there are no strong compulsive reasons which could morally condemn the whole practice of abortion. Some people may not unconvincingly argue that moral agreements and legal rights are due to human beings so that reasons for or against abortion are always subjective and relative. According to this view, one is only able to contend the "trueness" or "wrongness" of a particular action in a limited way. Of course, there are other people who argue for the opposite (for example, Kantians, Catholic Church). One reason why people have strong feelings about the conflict of abortion is that human beings do have strong intuitive feelings, for example, to feel compassion for fetuses as helpless and most vulnerable human entities. But moral intuitionism falls short by being a valid and objective basis for moral rights.

In the end, it is a question of a particular moral approach whether one regards an abortion as morally justifiable or not. But not every approach is justified. There is no anything goes.

6. Public Policy and Abortion

One of the most difficult issues is how to make a sound policy that meets the needs of most people in a given society without focusing on the extreme conservative view, or the extreme liberal view, or the many moderate views on the conflict of abortion. The point is simple, one cannot wait until the philosophical debate is settled, for maybe there is no one solution available. But, in fact, people in a society must know what the policy is; that is, they have to know when and under what circumstances abortion is permitted or altogether prohibited. What are the reasons for a given policy? Do they rest on religious beliefs or do they depend on cultural claims? Whose religious beliefs and whose cultural claims? Those beliefs and claims of most people or of the dominant group in a given society ? What about the problem of minority rights? Should they be respected or be refused? These are hard questions; no one is able to yet give a definite response.

But, of course, the problem of abortion has to be "solved," at least, with regard to practical matters. This means that a good policy does not rest on extreme views but tries to cover as many points of views, although being aware of the fact that one is not able to please every person in society. This would be an impossible task. It seems that one should adopt a moderate view rather than the proposed extreme views. This is not because the moderate view is "correct" but because one needs a broad consensus for a sound policy. The hardliners in the public debate on the conflict of abortion, be they proponents or opponents, may not be aware of the fact that neither view is sustainable for most people.

A sound way for governments with regard to a reasonable policy could be the acceptance of a more or less neutral stance that may function as a proper guide for law. But, in fact, the decisive claim of a "neutral stance" is, in turn, questionable. All ethical theories try to present a proper account of a so-called neutral stance but there is hardly any theory that could claim to be sustainable with regard to other approaches. However, the key seems to be, again, to accept a middle way to cover most points of views. In the end, a formation of a policy seeks a sound compromise people could live with. But this is not the end of the story. One should always try to find better ways to cope with hard ethical problems. The conflict of abortion is of that kind and there is no evidence to assume otherwise.

7. Clinical Ethics Consultation and Abortion

The vital issue of how one chooses whether or not to have an abortion is of utmost importance since people, in particular women, want to have a proper "guideline" that can support them in their process of ethical decision-making. According to pregnant women, the most crucial point seems not to be whether abortion is morally legitimate or not but, rather, how one should deliberate in the particular case. In fact, observations regularly show that women will nearly have the same number of abortions in contexts in which it is legal or not.

Gert is right in claiming that "the law can allow behavior that some people regard as morally unacceptable, such as early abortion, and it can prohibit behavior that some people regard as morally acceptable, such as late abortion. No one thinks that what the law decides about abortion settles the moral issue" (Gert 2004, 138). But what follows from that? What aspects should one consider and how should one decide in a particular case?

It would be best to consult a neutral person who has special knowledge and experiences in medicine and medical ethics (for example, clinical ethics consultation). Most people are usually not faced with hard conflicts of abortion in their daily lives and get simply swamped by it; they are unable to determine and evaluate all moral aspects of the given case and to foresee the relevant consequences of the possible actions (for example, especially with regard to very young women who get pregnant by mistake). They need professional help without being dominated by the person in order to clarify their own (ethical) stance.

However, the conflict of abortion as such may not be solvable, in the end, but the experienced professional is able to provide persons with feasible solutions for the particular case.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Boonin, David (2002), A Defense of Abortion Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Boylan, Michael (2002), “The Abortion Debate in the 21st Century” in Medical Ethics, ed. Michael Boylan. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Prentice Hall.
  • Chadwick, Ruth, Kuhse, Helga, Landman, Willem et al. (2007), The Bioethics Reader. Editor’s Choice Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.
  • English, Jane (1984), "Abortion and the Concept of a Person," in: The Problem of Abortion, 151-161.
  • Feinberg, Joel (1984), "Potentiality, Development, and Right," in: The Problem of Abortion, 145-150.
  • Feinberg, Joel (1984), The Problem of Abortion, Belmont: Wadsworth.
  • Gauthier, David (1986), Morals by Agreement, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gert, Bernard (2004), Common Morality. Deciding What to Do, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gillespie, Norman (1984), "Abortion and Human Rights," in: The Problem of Abortion, 94-102.
  • Gordon, John-S. (2005), "Die moralischen und rechtlichen Dimensionen der Abtreibungsproblematik," in: Conjectura, 43-62.
  • Hoerster, Norbert (1995), Abtreibung im säkularen Staat, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp.
  • Hobbes, Thomas (1996), Leviathan, Ed. Richard Tuck Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Korsgaard, Christine (1996), The Sources of Normativity, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Noonan, John T. (1970), "An Almost Absolute Value in History," in: The Morality of Abortion: Legal and Historical Perspectives, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 51-59.
  • Noonan, John T. (1970), The Morality of Abortion: Legal and Historical Perspectives, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Schwarz, Stephen (1990), Moral Questions of Abortion, Chicago: Loyola University Press.
  • Singer, Peter (1993), Practical Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sumner, Wayne (1980), Abortion and Moral Theory, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Thomson, Judith J. (1984), "A Defense of Abortion," in: The Problem of Abortion, 173-188.
  • Tooley, Michael (1983), Abortion and Infanticide, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Warren, Mary A. (1984), "On the Moral and Legal Status of Abortion," in: The Problem of Abortion, 102-119.
  • Warren, Mary A. (1997), "Abortion," in: A Companion to Ethics, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 303-314.

Author Information

John-Stewart Gordon
Ruhr-University Bochum

Environmental Ethics

The field of environmental ethics concerns human beings’ ethical relationship with the natural environment. While numerous philosophers have written on this topic throughout history, environmental ethics only developed into a specific philosophical discipline in the 1970s. This emergence was no doubt due to the increasing awareness in the 1960s of the effects that technology, industry, economic expansion and population growth were having on the environment. The development of such awareness was aided by the publication of two important books at this time. Rachel Carson’s Silent Spring, first published in 1962, alerted readers to how the widespread use of chemical pesticides was posing a serious threat to public health and leading to the destruction of wildlife. Of similar significance was Paul Ehrlich’s 1968 book, The Population Bomb, which warned of the devastating effects the spiraling human population has on the planet’s resources. Of course, pollution and the depletion of natural resources have not been the only environmental concerns since that time: dwindling plant and animal biodiversity, the loss of wilderness, the degradation of ecosystems, and climate change are all part of a raft of “green” issues that have implanted themselves into both public consciousness and public policy over subsequent years. The job of environmental ethics is to outline our moral obligations in the face of such concerns. In a nutshell, the two fundamental questions that environmental ethics must address are: what duties do humans have with respect to the environment, and why? The latter question usually needs to be considered prior to the former. In order to tackle just what our obligations are, it is usually thought necessary to consider first why we have them. For example, do we have environmental obligations for the sake of human beings living in the world today, for humans living in the future, or for the sake of entities within the environment itself, irrespective of any human benefits? Different philosophers have given quite different answers to this fundamental question which, as we shall see, has led to the emergence of quite different environmental ethics.

Table of Contents

  1. Extending Moral Standing
    1. Human Beings
    2. Sentient Animals
    3. Individual Living Organisms
    4. Holistic Entities
  2. Radical Ecology
    1. Deep Ecology
    2. Social Ecology
    3. Ecofeminism
  3. The Future of Environmental Ethics
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Extending Moral Standing

As noted above, perhaps the most fundamental question that must be asked when regarding a particular environmental ethic is simply, what obligations do we have concerning the natural environment? If the answer is simply that we, as human beings, will perish if we do not constrain our actions towards nature, then that ethic is considered to be “anthropocentric.” Anthropocentrism literally means “human-centeredness,” and in one sense all ethics must be considered anthropocentric. After all, as far as we know, only human beings can reason about and reflect upon ethical matters, thus giving all moral debate a definite “human-centeredness.” However, within environmental ethics anthropocentrism usually means something more than this. It usually refers to an ethical framework that grants “moral standing” solely to human beings. Thus, an anthropocentric ethic claims that only human beings are morally considerable in their own right, meaning that all the direct moral obligations we possess, including those we have with regard to the environment, are owed to our fellow human beings.

While the history of western philosophy is dominated by this kind anthropocentrism, it has come under considerable attack from many environmental ethicists. Such thinkers have claimed that ethics must be extended beyond humanity, and that moral standing should be accorded to the non-human natural world. Some have claimed that this extension should run to sentient animals, others to individual living organisms, and still others to holistic entities such as rivers, species and ecosystems. Under these ethics, we have obligations in respect of the environment because we actually owe things to the creatures or entities within the environment themselves. Determining whether our environmental obligations are founded on anthropocentric or non-anthropocentric reasoning will lead to different accounts of what those obligations are. This section examines the prominent accounts of moral standing within environmental ethics, together with the implications of each.

a. Human Beings

Although many environmental philosophers want to distance themselves from the label of anthropocentrism, it nevertheless remains the case that a number of coherent anthropocentric environmental ethics have been elaborated (Blackstone, 1972; Passmore, 1974; O’Neill, 1997; and Gewirth, 2001). This should be of little surprise, since many of the concerns we have regarding the environment appear to be concerns precisely because of the way they affect human beings. For example, pollution diminishes our health, resource depletion threatens our standards of living, climate change puts our homes at risk, the reduction of biodiversity results in the loss of potential medicines, and the eradication of wilderness means we lose a source of awe and beauty. Quite simply then, an anthropocentric ethic claims that we possess obligations to respect the environment for the sake of human well-being and prosperity.

Despite their human-centeredness, anthropocentric environmental ethics have nevertheless played a part in the extension of moral standing. This extension has not been to the non-human natural world though, but instead to human beings who do not yet exist. The granting of moral standing to future generations has been considered necessary because of the fact that many environmental problems, such as climate change and resource depletion, will affect future humans much more than they affect present ones. Moreover, it is evident that the actions and policies that we as contemporary humans undertake will have a great impact on the well-being of future individuals. In light of these facts, some philosophers have founded their environmental ethics on obligations to these future generations (Gewirth, 2001).

Of course, it is one thing to say that human beings in the future have moral standing, it is quite another to justify the position. Indeed, some philosophers have denied such standing to future people, claiming that they lie outside of our moral community because they cannot act reciprocally (Golding, 1972). So, while we can act so as to benefit them, they can give us nothing in return. This lack of reciprocity, so the argument goes, denies future people moral status. However, other philosophers have pointed to the fact that it is usually considered uncontroversial that we have obligations to the dead, such as executing their wills and so on, even though they cannot reciprocate (Kavka, 1978). While still others have conceded that although any future generation cannot do anything for us, it can nevertheless act for the benefit of its own subsequent generations, thus pointing to the existence of a broader transgenerational reciprocity (Gewirth, 2001).

However, perhaps we do not have obligations to future people because there is no definitive group of individuals to whom such obligations are owed. This argument is not based on the simple fact that future people do not exist yet, but on the fact that we do not know who they will be. Derek Parfit has called this the “non-identity problem” (Parfit, 1984, ch. 16). The heart of this problem lies in the fact that the policies adopted by states directly affect the movement, education, employment and so on of their citizens. Thus, such policies affect who meets whom, and who has children with whom. So, one set of policies will lead to one group of future people, while another set will lead to a different group. Our actions impact who will exist in the future, making our knowledge of who they will be incomprehensible. Since there is no definitive set of future people to receive the benefits or costs of our actions, to whom do we grant moral standing? Secondly, and of particular importance for environmental ethics, how could any future people legitimately complain that they have been wronged by our environmentally destructive policies? For if we had not conducted such policies, they would not even exist.

In response to the non-identity problem, it has been argued that while we do not know exactly who will exist in the future, we do know that some group of people will exist and that they will have interests. In light of this, perhaps our obligations lie with these interests, rather than the future individuals themselves (DesJardins, 2001, p. 74). As for the second aspect of the problem, we might claim that although future generations will benefit from our environmentally destructive policies by their very existence, they will nevertheless have been harmed. After all, cannot one be harmed by a particular action even if one benefits overall? To illustrate this point, James Woodward gives the example of a racist airline refusing to allow a black man on a flight that subsequently crashes (Woodward, 1986). Isn’t this man harmed by the airline, even though he benefits overall?

Even if we do decide to grant moral standing to future human beings, however, that still leaves the problem of deciding just what obligations we have to them. One set of difficulties relates to our ignorance of who they are. For not only do we lack information about the identity of future people, but we have neither knowledge of their conceptions of a good life, nor what technological advances they may have made. For example, why bother preserving rare species of animal or oil reserves if humans in the future receive no satisfaction from the diversity of life and have developed some alternative fuel source? Our ignorance of such matters makes it very difficult to flesh out the content of our obligations.

By way of reply to such problems, some philosophers have argued that while we do not know everything about future people, we can make some reasonable assumptions. For example, Brian Barry has argued that in order to pursue their idea of the good life - whatever that happens to be - future people will have need of some basic resources, such as food, water, minimum health and so on (Barry, 1999). Barry thus argues that our obligations lie with ensuring that we do not prevent future generations from meeting their basic needs. This, in turn, forces us to consider and appropriately revise our levels of pollution, resource depletion, climate change and population growth. While this might seem a rather conservative ethic to some, it is worth pointing out that at no time in humanity’s history have the needs of contemporaries been met, let alone those of future people. This unfortunate fact points to a further problem that all future-oriented anthropocentric environmental ethics must face. Just how are the needs and interests of the current generation to be weighed against the needs and interests of those human beings in the future? Can we justifiably let present people go without for the sake of future humans?

Clearly then, the problems posed by just a minimal extension of moral standing are real and difficult. Despite this, however, most environmental philosophers feel that such anthropocentric ethics do not go far enough, and want to extend moral standing beyond humanity. Only by doing this, such thinkers argue, can we get the beyond narrow and selfish interests of humans, and treat the environment and its inhabitants with the respect they deserve.

b. Animals

If only human beings have moral standing, then it follows that if I come across a bear while out camping and shoot it dead on a whim, I do no wrong to that bear. Of course, an anthropocentric ethic might claim that I do some wrong by shooting the bear dead – perhaps shooting bears is not the action of a virtuous individual, or perhaps I am depleting a source of beauty for most other humans – but because anthropocentrism states that only humans have moral standing, then I can do no wrong to the bear itself. However, many of us have the intuition that this claim is wrong. Many of us feel that it is possible to do wrong to animals, whether that be by shooting innocent bears or by torturing cats. Of course, a feeling or intuition does not get us very far in proving that animals have moral standing. For one thing, some people (hunters and cat-torturers, for example) no doubt have quite different intuitions, leading to quite different conclusions. However, several philosophers have offered sophisticated arguments to support the view that moral standing should be extended to include animals (see Animals and Ethics).

Peter Singer and Tom Regan are the most famous proponents of the view that we should extend moral standing to other species of animal. While both develop quite different animal ethics, their reasons for according moral status to animals are fairly similar. According to Singer, the criterion for moral standing is sentience: the capacity to feel pleasure and pain (Singer, 1974). For Regan, on the other hand, moral standing should be acknowledged in all “subjects-of-a-life”: that is, those beings with beliefs, desires, perception, memory, emotions, a sense of future and the ability to initiate action (Regan, 1983/2004, ch. 7). So, while Regan and Singer give slightly different criteria for moral standing, both place a premium on a form of consciousness.

For Singer, if an entity possesses the relevant type of consciousness, then that entity should be given equal consideration when we formulate our moral obligations. Note that the point is not that every sentient being should be treated equally, but that it should be considered equally. In other words, the differences between individuals, and thus their different interests, should be taken into account. Thus, for Singer it would not be wrong to deny pigs the vote, for obviously pigs have no interest in participating in a democratic society; but it would be wrong to subordinate pigs’ interest in not suffering, for clearly pigs have a strong interest in avoiding pain, just like us. Singer then feeds his principle of equal consideration into a utilitarian ethical framework, whereby the ultimate moral goal is to bring about the greatest possible satisfaction of interests. So there are two strands to Singer’s theory: first of all, we must consider the interests of sentient beings equally; and secondly, our obligations are founded on the aim of bringing about the greatest amount of interest-satisfaction that we can.

Tom Regan takes issue with Singer’s utilitarian ethical framework, and uses the criterion of consciousness to build a “rights-based” theory. For Regan, all entities who are “subjects-of-a-life” possess “inherent value”. This means that such entities have a value of their own, irrespective of their good for other beings or their contribution to some ultimate ethical norm. In effect then, Regan proposes that there are moral limits to what one can do to a subject-of-a-life. This position stands in contrast to Singer who feeds all interests into the utilitarian calculus and bases our moral obligations on what satisfies the greatest number. Thus, in Singer’s view it might be legitimate to sacrifice the interests of certain individuals for the sake of the interest-satisfaction of others. For example, imagine that it is proven that a particular set of painful experiments on half a dozen pigs will lead to the discovery of some new medicine that will itself alleviate the pain of a few dozen human beings (or other sentient animals). If one’s ultimate norm is to satisfy the maximum number of interests, then such experiments should take place. However, for Regan there are moral limits to what one can do to an entity with inherent value, irrespective of these overall consequences. These moral limits are “rights”, and are possessed by all creatures who are subjects-of-a-life.

But what does all this have to do with environmental ethics? Well, in one obvious sense animal welfare is relevant to environmental ethics because animals exist within the natural environment and thus form part of environmentalists’ concerns. However, extending moral standing to animals also leads to the formulation of particular types of environmental obligations. Essentially, these ethics claim that when we consider how our actions impact on the environment, we should not just evaluate how these affect humans (present and/or future), but also how they affect the interests and rights of animals (Singer, 1993, ch. 10, and Regan, 1983/2004, ch. 9). For example, even if clearing an area of forest were proven to be of benefit to humans both in the short and long-term, that would not be the end of the matter as far as animal ethics are concerned. The welfare of the animals residing within and around the forest must also be considered.

However, many environmental philosophers have been dissatisfied with these kinds of animal-centered environmental ethics. Indeed, some have claimed that animal liberation cannot even be considered a legitimate environmental ethic (Callicott, 1980, Sagoff, 1984). For these thinkers, all animal-centered ethics suffer from two fundamental and devastating problems: first of all, they are too narrowly individualistic; and secondly, the logic of animal ethics implies unjustifiable interference with natural processes. As for the first point, it is pointed out that our concerns for the environment extend beyond merely worrying about individual creatures. Rather, for environmentalists, “holistic” entities matter, such as species and ecosystems. Moreover, sometimes the needs of a “whole” clash with the interests of the individuals that comprise it. Indeed, the over-abundance of individuals of a particular species of animal can pose a serious threat to the normal functioning of an ecosystem. For example, many of us will be familiar with the problems rabbits have caused to ecosystems in Australia. Thus, for many environmentalists, we have an obligation to kill these damaging animals. Clearly, this stands opposed to the conclusions of an ethic that gives such weight to the interests and rights of individual animals. The individualistic nature of an animal-centered ethic also means that it faces difficulty in explaining our concern for the plight of endangered species. After all, if individual conscious entities are all that matter morally, then the last surviving panda must be owed just the same as my pet cat. For many environmental philosophers this is simply wrong, and priority must be given to the endangered species (Rolston III, 1985).

Animal-centered ethics also face attack for some of the implications of their arguments. For example, if we have obligations to alleviate the suffering of animals, as these authors suggest, does that mean we must stop predator animals from killing their prey, or partition off prey animals so that they are protected from such attacks (Sagoff, 1984)? Such conclusions not only seem absurd, but also inimical to the environmentalist goal of preserving natural habitats and processes.

Having said all of this, I should not over-emphasize the opposition between animal ethics and environmental ethics. Just because animal ethicists grant moral standing only to conscious individuals, that does not mean that they hold everything else in contempt (Jamieson, 1998). Holistic entities may not have independent moral standing, according to these thinkers, but that does not equate to ignoring them. After all, the welfare and interests of individual entities are often bound up with the healthy functioning of the “wholes” that they make up. Moreover, the idea that animal ethics imply large-scale interferences in the environment can be questioned when one considers how much harm this would inflict upon predator and scavenger animals. Nevertheless, clashes of interest between individual animals and other natural entities are inevitable, and when push comes to shove animal ethicists will invariably grant priority to individual conscious animals. Many environmental ethicists disagree, and are convinced that the boundaries of our ethical concern need to be pushed back further.

c. Individual Living Organisms

As noted above, numerous philosophers have questioned the notion that only conscious beings have moral standing. Some have done this by proposing a thought experiment based on a “last-human scenario” (Attfield, 1983, p. 155). The thought experiment asks us to consider a situation, such as the aftermath of a nuclear holocaust, where the only surviving human being is faced with the only surviving tree of its species. If the individual chops down the tree, no human would be harmed by its destruction. For our purposes we should alter the example and say that all animals have also perished in the holocaust. If this amendment is made, we can go further and say that no conscious being would be harmed by the tree’s destruction. Would this individual be wrong to destroy the tree? According to a human or animal-centered ethic, it is hard to see why such destruction would be wrong. And yet, many of us have the strong intuition that the individual would act wrongly by chopping down the tree. For some environmental philosophers, this intuition suggests that moral standing should be extended beyond conscious life to include individual living organisms, such as trees.

Of course, and as I have mentioned before, we cannot rely only on intuitions to decide who or what has moral standing. For this reason, a number of philosophers have come up with arguments to justify assigning moral standing to individual living organisms. One of the earliest philosophers to put forward such an argument was Albert Schweitzer. Schweitzer’s influential “Reverence for Life” ethic claims that all living things have a “will to live”, and that humans should not interfere with or extinguish this will (Schweitzer, 1923). But while it is clear that living organisms struggle for survival, it is simply not true that they “will” to live. This, after all, would require some kind of conscious experience, which many living things lack. However, perhaps what Schweitzer was getting at was something like Paul W. Taylor’s more recent claim that all living things are “teleological centers of life” (Taylor, 1986). For Taylor, this means that living things have a good of their own that they strive towards, even if they lack awareness of this fact. This good, according to Taylor, is the full development of an organism’s biological powers. In similar arguments to Regan’s, Taylor claims that because living organisms have a good of their own, they have inherent value; that is, value for their own sake, irrespective of their value to other beings. It is this value that grants individual living organisms moral status, and means that we must take the interests and needs of such entities into account when formulating our moral obligations.

But if we recognize moral standing in every living thing, how are we then to formulate any meaningful moral obligations? After all, don’t we as humans require the destruction of many living organisms simply in order to live? For example we need to walk, eat, shelter and clothe ourselves, all of which will usually involve harming living things. Schweitzer’s answer is that we can only harm or end the life of a living entity when absolutely necessary. Of course, this simply begs the question: when is absolutely necessary? Taylor attempts to answer this question by advocating a position of general equality between the interests of living things, together with a series of principles in the event of clashes of interest. First, the principles state that humans are allowed to act in self-defense to prevent harm being inflicted by other living organisms. Second, the basic interests of nonhuman living entities should take priority over the nonbasic or trivial interests of humans. Third, when basic interests clash, humans are not required to sacrifice themselves for the sake of others (Taylor, 1986, pp. 264-304).

As several philosophers have pointed out, however, this ethic is still incredibly demanding. For example, because my interest in having a pretty garden is nonbasic, and a weed’s interest in survival is basic, I am forbidden from pulling it out according to Taylor’s ethical framework. For some, this makes the ethic unreasonably burdensome. No doubt because of these worries, other philosophers who accord moral standing to all living organisms have taken a rather different stance. Instead of adopting an egalitarian position on the interests of living things, they propose a hierarchical framework (Attfield, 1983 and Varner, 1998). Such thinkers point out that moral standing is not the same as moral significance. So while we could acknowledge that plants have moral standing, we might nevertheless accord them a much lower significance than human beings, thus making it easier to justify our use and destruction of them. Nevertheless, several philosophers remain uneasy about the construction of such hierarchies and wonder whether it negates the acknowledgement of moral standing in the first place. After all, if we accept such a hierarchy, just how low is the moral significance of plants? If it is low enough so that I can eat them, weed them and walk on them, what is the point of granting them any moral standing at all?

There remain two crucial challenges facing philosophers who attribute moral standing to individual living organisms that have not yet been addressed. One challenge comes from the anthropocentric thinkers and animal liberationists. They deny that “being alive” is a sufficient condition for the possession of moral standing. For example, while plants may have a biological good, is it really good of their own? Indeed, there seems to be no sense in which something can be said to be good or bad from the point of view of the plant itself. And if the plant doesn’t care about its fate, why should we (Warren, 2000, p. 48)? In response to this challenge, environmental ethicists have pointed out that conscious volition of an object or state is not necessary for that object or state to be a good. For example, consider a cat that needs worming. It is very unlikely that the cat has any understanding of what worming is, or that he needs worming in order to remain healthy and fit. However, it makes perfect sense to say that worming is good for the cat, because it contributes to the cat’s functioning and flourishing. Similarly, plants and tress may not consciously desire sunlight, water or nutrition, but each, according to some ethicists, can be said to be good for them in that they contribute to their biological flourishing.

The second challenge comes from philosophers who question the individualistic nature of these particular ethics. As mentioned above, these critics do not believe that an environmental ethic should place such a high premium on individuals. For many, this individualistic stance negates important ecological commitments to the interdependence of living things, and the harmony to be found in natural processes. Moreover, it is alleged that these individualistic ethics suffer from the same faults as anthropocentric and animal-centered ethics: they simply cannot account for our real and demanding obligations to holistic entities such as species and ecosystems. Once again, however, a word of caution is warranted here. It is not the case that philosophers who ascribe moral standing to individual living things simply ignore the importance of such “wholes”. Often the equilibrium of these entities is taken extremely seriously (See Taylor, 1986, p. 77). However, it must be remembered that such concern is extended only insofar as such equilibrium is necessary in order for individual living organisms to flourish; the wholes themselves have no independent moral standing. In the next section, those philosophers who claim that this standing should be extended to such “wholes” will be examined.

d. Holistic Entities

While Albert Schweitzer can be regarded as the most prominent philosophical influence for thinkers who grant moral standing to all individual living things, Aldo Leopold is undoubtedly the main influence on those who propose “holistic” ethics. Aldo Leopold’s “land ethic” demands that we stop treating the land as a mere object or resource. For Leopold, land is not merely soil. Instead, land is a fountain of energy, flowing through a circuit of soils, plants and animals. While food chains conduct the energy upwards from the soil, death and decay returns the energy back to the soil. Thus, the flow of energy relies on a complex structure of relations between living things. While evolution gradually changes these relations, Leopold argues that man’s interventions have been much more violent and destructive. In order to preserve the relations within the land, Leopold claims that we must move towards a “land ethic”, thereby granting moral standing to the land community itself, not just its individual members. This culminates in Leopold’s famous ethical injunction: “A thing is right when it tends to preserve the integrity, stability, and beauty of the biotic community. It is wrong when it tends otherwise” (Leopold, 1949/1989, pp. 218-225).

Several philosophers, however, have questioned Leopold’s justification of the land ethic. For one thing, it seems that Leopold jumps too quickly from a descriptive account of how the land is, to a prescriptive account of what we ought to do. In other words, even if Leopold’s accounts of the land and its energy flows are correct, why should we preserve it? What precisely is it about the biotic community that makes it deserving of moral standing? Unfortunately, Leopold seems to offer no answers to these important questions, and thus no reason to build our environmental obligations around his land ethic. However, J. Baird Callicott has argued that such criticisms of Leopold are unfair and misplaced. According to Callicott, Leopold lies outside of mainstream moral theory. Rather than assign moral standing on the identification of some particular characteristic, such as consciousness or a biological good of one’s own, Leopold is claimed to accord moral standing on the basis of moral sentiment and affection. Thus, the question is not, what quality does the land possess that makes it worthy of moral standing? But rather, how do we feel about the land (Callicott, 1998)? In this light, the land ethic can be seen as an injunction to broaden our moral sentiments beyond self-interest, and beyond humanity to include the whole biotic community. This, so the argument goes, bridges the gap between the descriptive and the prescriptive in Leopold’s thought.

Of course, some have questioned whether sentiment and feelings are suitable foundations for an environmental ethic. After all, there seem to be plenty of people out there who have no affection for the biotic community whatsoever. If Leopold’s injunction is ignored by such people, must we simply give up hope of formulating any environmental obligations? In the search for more concrete foundations, Lawrence E. Johnson has built an alternative case for according moral standing to holistic entities (Johnson, 1993). Johnson claims that once we recognize that interests are not always tied to conscious experience, the door is opened to the possibility of nonconscious entities having interests and thus moral standing. So, just as breathing oxygen is in the interests of a child, even though the child has neither a conscious desire for oxygen, nor any understanding of what oxygen is, so do species have an interest in fulfilling their nature. This is because both have a good of their own, based on the integrated functioning of their life processes (ibid., p. 142). Children can flourish as living things, and so too can species and ecosystems; so, according to Johnson, both have interests that must be taken into account in our ethical deliberations.

But even if we accept that moral standing should be extended to holistic entities on this basis, we still need to consider how we are then to flesh out our moral obligations concerning the environment. For some, this is where holistic ethics fail to convince. In particular, it has been claimed that holistic ethics condone sacrificing individuals for the sake of the whole. Now while many holistic philosophers do explicitly condone sacrificing individuals in some situations, for example by shooting rabbits to preserve plant species, they are reluctant to sacrifice human interests in similar situations. But isn’t the most abundant species destroying biotic communities Homo sapiens? And if human individuals are just another element within the larger and more important biotic community, is it not necessary under holistic ethics to kill some of these “human pests” for the sake of the larger whole? Such considerations have led Tom Regan to label the implications of holistic ethics as “environmental fascism” (Regan, 1983/2004, p. 362). In response, proponents of such ethics have claimed that acknowledging moral standing in holistic entities does not mean that one must deny the interests and rights of human beings. They claim that granting moral standing to “wholes” is not the same thing as taking it away from individuals. While this is obviously true, that still leaves the question of what to do when the interests of wholes clash with the interests of individuals. If humans cannot be sacrificed for the good of the whole, why can rabbits?

The answer that has been put forward by Callicott claims that while the biotic community matters morally, it is not the only community that matters. Rather, we are part of various “nested” communities all of which have claims upon us. Thus, our obligations to the biotic community may require the culling of rabbits, but may not require the culling of humans. This is because we are part of a tight-knit human community, but only a very loose human-rabbit community. In this way, we can adjudicate clashes of interest, based on our community commitments. This communitarian proposal certainly seems a way out of the dilemma. Unfortunately, it faces two key problems: first, just who decides the content and strength of our various community commitments; and second, if human relationships are the closest, does all this lead back to anthropocentrism? As for the first point, if deciding on our community attachments is left up to individuals themselves, this will lead to quite diverse and even repugnant moral obligations. For example, if an individual believes that he has a much stronger attachment to white males than to black women, does this mean that he can legitimately favor the interests of the former over the latter? If not, and an objective standard is to be imposed, we are left with the enormous problem of discovering this standard and reaching consensus on it. Secondly, if our moral commitments to the biotic community are trumped by our obligations to the human community, doesn’t this lead us back down the path to anthropocentrism – the very thing the holist wants to avoid?

Without doubt, extending moral standing to the degree of holistic ethics requires some extremely careful argumentation when it comes to working out the precise content of our environmental obligations.

2. Radical Ecology

Not all philosophers writing on our obligations concerning the environment see the problem simply in terms of extending moral standing. Instead, many thinkers regard environmental concerns to have warranted an entirely new ideological perspective that has been termed, after its biological counterpart, “ecology”. While the ideas and beliefs within this “radical ecology” movement are diverse, they possess two common elements that separates them from the ethical extensionism outlined above. First of all, none see extending moral standing as sufficient to resolve the environmental crisis. They argue that a broader philosophical perspective is needed, requiring fundamental changes in both our attitude to and understanding of reality. This involves reexamining who we are as human beings and our place within the natural world. For radical ecologists, ethical extensionism is inadequate because it is stuck in the traditional ways of thinking that led to these environmental problems in the first place. In short, it is argued that ethical extensionism remains too human-centered, because it takes human beings as the paradigm examples of entities with moral standing and then extends outwards to those things considered sufficiently similar. Secondly, none of these radical ecologies confine themselves solely to the arena of ethics. Instead, radical ecologies also demand fundamental changes in society and its institutions. In other words, these ideologies have a distinctively political element, requiring us to confront the environmental crisis by changing the very way we live and function, both as a society and as individuals.

a. Deep Ecology

Deep ecology is perhaps most easily understood when considered in opposition to its “shallow” counterpart. According to deep ecologists, shallow ecology is anthropocentric and concerned with pollution and resource depletion. Shallow ecology might thus be regarded as very much the mainstream wing of environmentalism. Deep ecology, in contrast, rejects anthropocentrism and takes a “total-field” perspective. In other words, deep ecologists are not aiming to formulate moral principles concerning the environment to supplement our existing ethical framework. Instead, they demand an entirely new worldview and philosophical perspective. According to Arne Naess, the Norwegian philosopher who first outlined this shallow-deep split in environmentalism, deep ecologists advocate the development of a new eco-philosophy or “ecosophy“ to replace the destructive philosophy of modern industrial society (Naess, 1973). While the various eco-philosophies that have developed within deep ecology are diverse, Naess and George Sessions have compiled a list of eight principles or statements that are basic to deep ecology:

  1. The well-being and flourishing of human and non-human life on Earth have value in themselves (synonyms: intrinsic value, inherent worth). These values are independent of the usefulness of the non-human world for human purposes.
  2. Richness and diversity of life forms contribute to the realization of these values and are also values in themselves.
  3. Humans have no right to reduce this richness and diversity except to satisfy vital needs.
  4. The flourishing of human life and cultures is compatible with a substantially smaller population. The flourishing of non-human life requiresa smaller human population.
  5. Present human interference with the non-human world is excessive, and the situation is rapidly worsening.
  6. Policies must therefore be changed. These policies affect basic economic, technological and ideological structures. The resulting state of affairs will be deeply different from the present.
  7. The ideological change will be mainly that of appreciating life quality (dwelling in situations of inherent value) rather than adhering to an increasingly higher standard of living. There will be a profound awareness of the difference between bigness and greatness.
  8. Those who subscribe to the foregoing points have an obligation directly or indirectly to try to implement the necessary changes (Naess, 1986).

But while Naess regards those who subscribe to these statements as supporters of deep ecology, he does not believe it to follow that all such supporters will have the same worldview or “ecosophy”. In other words deep ecologists do not offer one unified ultimate perspective, but possess various and divergent philosophical and religious allegiances.

Naess’s own ecosophy involves just one fundamental ethical norm: “Self-realization!” For Naess, this norm involves giving up a narrow egoistic conception of the self in favor of a wider more comprehensive Self (hence the deliberate capital “S”). Moving to this wider Self involves recognizing that as human beings we are not removed from nature, but are interconnected with it. Recognizing our wider Self thus involves identifying ourselves with all other life forms on the planet. The Australian philosopher Warwick Fox has taken up this theme of self-realization in his own eco-philosophy, “transpersonal ecology”. Fox does not regard environmental ethics to be predominantly about formulating our moral obligations concerning the environment, but instead views it as about the realization of an “ecological consciousness”. For Fox, as with Naess, this consciousness involves our widest possible identification with the non-human world. The usual ethical concern of formulating principles and obligations thus becomes unnecessary, according to Fox, for once the appropriate consciousness is established, one will naturally protect the environment and allow it to flourish, for that will be part and parcel of the protection and flourishing of oneself (Fox,1990).

Critics of deep ecology argue that it is just too vague to address real environmental concerns. For one thing, in its refusal to reject so many worldviews and philosophical perspectives, many have claimed that it is difficult to uncover just what deep ecology advocates. For example, on the one hand, Naess offers us eight principles that deep ecologists should accept, and on the other he claims that deep ecology is not about drawing up codes of conduct, but adopting a global comprehensive attitude. Now, if establishing principles is important, as so many ethicists believe, perhaps deep ecology requires more precision than can be found in Naess and Sessions’s platform. In particular, just how are we to deal with clashes of interests? According to the third principle, for example, humans have no right to reduce the richness and diversity of the natural world unless to meet vital needs. But does that mean we are under an obligation to protect the richness and diversity of the natural world? If so, perhaps we could cull non-native species such as rabbits when they damage ecosystems. But then, the first principle states that non-human beings such as rabbits have inherent value, and the fifth principle states that human interference in nature is already excessive. So just what should we do? Clearly, the principles as stated by Naess and Sessions are too vague to offer any real guide for action.

However, perhaps principles are not important, as both Naess and Fox have claimed. Instead, they claim that we must rely on the fostering of the appropriate states of consciousness. Unfortunately, two problems remain. First of all, it is not at all clear that all conflicts of interest will be resolved by the adoption of the appropriate state of consciousness. For even if I identify myself with all living things, some of those things, such as bacteria and viruses, may still threaten me as a discrete living organism. And if conflicts of interest remain, don’t we need principles to resolve them? Secondly, and as we saw with Leopold’s land ethic, just what are we to do about those who remain unconvinced about adopting this new state of consciousness? If there aren’t any rational arguments, principles or obligations to point to, what chance is there of persuading such people to take the environmental crisis seriously?

At this point deep ecologists would object that such criticisms remain rooted in the ideology that has caused so much of the crisis we now face. For example, take the point about persuading others. Deep ecologists claim that argument and debate are not the only means we must use to help people realize their ecological consciousness; we must also use such things as poetry, music and art. This relates back to the point I made at the beginning of the section: deep ecologists do not call for supplementary moral principles concerning the environment, but an entirely new worldview. Whether such a radical shift in the way we think about ourselves and the environment is possible, remains to be seen.

b. Social Ecology

Social ecology shares with deep ecology the view that the foundations of the environmental crisis lie in the dominant ideology of modern western societies. Thus, just as with deep ecology, social ecology claims that in order to resolve the crisis, a radical overhaul of this ideology is necessary. However, the new ideology that social ecology proposes is not concerned with the “self-realization” of deep ecology, but instead the absence of domination. Indeed, domination is the key theme in the writings of Murray Bookchin, the most prominent social ecologist. For Bookchin, environmental problems are directly related to social problems. In particular, Bookchin claims that the hierarchies of power prevalent within modern societies have fostered a hierarchical relationship between humans and the natural world (Bookchin, 1982). Indeed, it is the ideology of the free market that has facilitated such hierarchies, reducing both human beings and the natural world to mere commodities. Bookchin argues that the liberation of both humans and nature are actually dependent on one another. Thus his argument is quite different from Marxist thought, in which man’s freedom is dependent on the complete domination of the natural world through technology. For Bookchin and other social ecologists, this Marxist thinking involves the same fragmentation of humans from nature that is prevalent in capitalist ideology. Instead, it is argued that humans must recognize that they are part of nature, not distinct or separate from it. In turn then, human societies and human relations with nature can be informed by the non-hierarchical relations found within the natural world. For example, Bookchin points out that within an ecosystem, there is no species more important than another, instead relationships are mutualistic and interrelated. This interdependence and lack of hierarchy in nature, it is claimed, provides a blueprint for a non-hierarchical human society (Bookchin, 2001).

Without doubt, the transformation that Bookchin calls for is radical. But just what will this new non-hierarchical, interrelated and mutualistic human society look like? For Bookchin, an all powerful centralized state is just another agent for domination. Thus in order to truly be rid of hierarchy, the transformation must take place within smaller local communities. Such communities will be based on sustainable agriculture, participation through democracy, and of course freedom through non-domination. Not only then does nature help cement richer and more equal human communities, but transformed societies also foster a more benign relationship with nature. This latter point illustrates Bookchin’s optimistic view of humanity’s potential. After all, Bookchin does not think that we should condemn all of humanity for causing the ecological crisis, for instead it is the relationships within societies that are to blame (Bookchin, 1991). Because of this, Bookchin is extremely critical of the anti-humanism and misanthropy he perceives to be prevalent in much deep ecology.

One problem that has been identified with Bookchin’s social ecology is his extrapolation from the natural world to human society. Bookchin argues that the interdependence and lack of hierarchy within nature provides a grounding for non-hierarchical human societies. However, as we saw when discussing Aldo Leopold, it is one thing to say how nature is, but quite another to say how society ought to be. Even if we accept that there are no natural hierarchies within nature (which for many is dubious), there are plenty of other aspects of it that most of us would not want to foster in our human society. For example, weak individuals and weak species are often killed, eaten and out-competed in an ecosystem. This, of course, is perfectly natural and even fits in with ecology’s characterization of nature as interconnected. However, should this ground human societies in which the weak are killed, eaten and out-competed? Most of us find such a suggestion repugnant. Following this type of reasoning, many thinkers have warned of the dangers of drawing inferences about how society should be organized from certain facts about how nature is (Dobson, 1995, p. 42).

Some environmental philosophers have also pointed to a second problem with Bookchin’s theory. For many, his social ecology is anthropocentric, thus failing to grant the environment the standing it deserves. Critics cite evidence of anthropocentrism in the way Bookchin accounts for the liberation of both humans and nature. This unfolding process will not just occur of its own accord, according to Bookchin, rather, human beings must facilitate it. Of course, many philosophers are extremely skeptical of the very idea that history is inevitably “unfolding” towards some particular direction. However, some environmental philosophers are more wary of the prominent place that Bookchin gives to human beings in facilitating this unfolding. Of course, to what extent this is a problem depends on one’s point of view. After all, if humans cannot ameliorate the environmental problems we face, is there much point doing environmental ethics in the first place? Indeed, Bookchin himself has been rather nonplussed by this charge, and explicitly denies that humans are just another community in nature. But he also denies that nature exists solely for the purposes of humans. However, the critics remain unconvinced, and believe it to be extremely arrogant to think that humans know what the unfolding of nature will look like, let alone to think that they can bring it about (Eckersley, 1992, pp. 154-156).

c. Ecofeminism

Like social ecology, ecofeminism also points to a link between social domination and the domination of the natural world. And like both deep ecology and social ecology, ecofeminism calls for a radical overhaul of the prevailing philosophical perspective and ideology of western society. However, ecofeminism is a broad church, and there are actually a number of different positions that feminist writers on the environment have taken. In this section I will review three of the most prominent.

Val Plumwood offers a critique of the rationalism inherent in traditional ethics and blames this rationalism for the oppression of both women and nature. The fundamental problem with rationalism, so Plumwood claims, is its fostering of dualisms. For example, reason itself is usually presented in stark opposition to emotion. Traditional ethics, Plumwood argues, promote reason as capable of providing a stable foundation for moral argument, because of its impartiality and universalizability. Emotion, on the other hand, lacks these characteristics, and because it is based on sentiment and affection makes for shaky ethical frameworks. Plumwood claims that this dualism between reason and emotion grounds other dualisms in rationalist thought: in particular, mind/body, human/nature and man/woman. In each case, the former is held to be superior to the latter (Plumwood, 1991). So, for Plumwood, the inferiority of both women and nature have a common source: namely, rationalism. Once this is recognized, so the argument goes, it becomes clear that simple ethical extensionism as outlined above is insufficient to resolve the domination of women and nature. After all, such extensionism is stuck in the same mainstream rationalist thought that is the very source of the problem. What is needed instead, according to Plumwood, is a challenge to rationalism itself, and thus a challenge to the dualisms it perpetuates.

However, while it is perfectly possible to acknowledge the rationalism present in much mainstream ethical thinking, one can nevertheless query Plumwood’s characterization of it. After all, does rationalism necessarily

promote dualisms that are responsible for the subjugation of women and nature? Such a claim would seem odd given the many rationalist arguments that have been put forward to promote the rights and interests of both women and the natural world. In addition, many thinkers would argue that rationalist thought is not the enemy, but instead the best hope for securing proper concern for the environment and for women. For as we have seen above, such thinkers believe that relying on the sentiments and feelings of individuals is too unstable a foundation upon which to ground a meaningful ethical framework.

Karen J. Warren has argued that the dualisms of rationalist thought, as outlined by Plumwood, are not in themselves problematic. Rather, Warren claims that they become problematic when they are used in conjunction with an “oppressive conceptual framework” to justifysubordination. Warren argues that one feature inherent within an oppressive conceptual framework is the “logic of domination”. Thus, a list of the differences between humans and nature, and between men and women, is not in itself harmful. But once assumptions are added, such as these differences leading to the moral superiority

of humans and of men, then we move closer to the claim that we are justified in subordinating women and nature on the basis of their inferiority. According to Warren, just such a logic of domination has been prevalent within western society. Men have been identified with the realm of the “mental” and “human”, while women have been identified with the “physical” and the “natural”. Once it is claimed that the “natural” and the “physical” are morally inferior to the “human” and “mental”, men become justified in subordinating women and nature. For Warren then, feminists and environmentalists share the same goal: namely, to abolish this oppressive conceptual framework (Warren, 1990).

Other ecofeminists take a quite different approach to Plumwood and Warren. Rather than outlining the connections between the domination

of women and of nature, they instead emphasize those things that link women and the natural world. Women, so the argument goes, stand in a much closer relationship to the natural world due to their capacity for child-bearing. For some ecofeminists, this gives women a unique perspective on how to build harmonious relationships with the natural world. Indeed, many such thinkers advocate a spiritualist approach in which nature and the land are given a sacred value, harking back to ancient religions in which the Earth is considered female (Mies & Shiva, 1993).

For writers such as Plumwood, however, emphasizing women’s “naturalness” in this way simply reinforces the dualism that led to women’s oppression in the first place. Placing women as closer to nature, according to Plumwood, simply places them closer to oppression. Other critics argue that the adoption of a spiritualist approach leads feminists to turn their attention inwards to themselves and their souls, and away from those individuals and entities they should be trying to liberate. However, in response, these ecofeminists may make the same point as the deep ecologists: to resolve the environmental problems we face, and the systems of domination in place, it is the consciousness and philosophical outlook of individuals that must change.

3. The Future of Environmental Ethics

Given the increasing concern for the environment and the impact that our actions have upon it, it is clear that the field of environmental ethics is here to stay.

However, it is less clear in what way the discipline will move forward. Having said that,

there is evidence for at least three future developments. First of all, environmental ethics needs to be and will be informed by changes in the political efforts to ameliorate environmental problems. Environmental ethics concerns formulating our moral obligations regarding the environment. While this enterprise can be, and often is, quite abstract, it is also meant to engage with the real world. After all, ethicists are making claims about how they think the world ought to be. Given this, the effectiveness of states and governments in “getting there” will affect the types of ethics that emerge. For example, the Kyoto Protocol might be regarded as the first real global attempt to deal with the problem of climate change. However, without the participation of so many large polluters, with the agreed reductions in greenhouse gas emissions so small, and with many countries looking like they may well miss their targets, many commentators already regard it as a failure. Ethicists need to respond not just by castigating those they blame for the failure. Rather they must propose alternative and better means of resolving the problems we face. For example, is it more important to outline a scheme of obligations for individuals

rather than states, and go for a bottom-up solution to these problems? Alternatively, perhaps businesses

should take the lead in tackling these problems. Indeed, it may even be in the interests of big business to be active in this way, given the power of consumers. It is quite possible then, that we will see business ethics address many of the same issues that environmental ethics has been tackling.

However, the effects of environmental ethics will not be limited to influencing and informing business ethics alone, but will undoubtedly feed into and merge with more mainstream ethical thinking.

After all, the environment is not something one can remove oneself from. In light of this, once it is recognized that we have environmental obligations, all areas of ethics are affected, including just war theory, domestic distributive justice, global distributive justice, human rights theory and many others. Take global distributive justice as an example: if one considers how climate change will affect people throughout the world so differently – affecting individuals’ homes, sanitation, resistance from disease, ability to earn a living and so on - it is clear that consideration of the environment is essential to such questions of justice. Part of the job of the environmental ethicist will thus be to give such disciplines the benefit of his or her expertise.

Finally, environmental ethics will of course be informed by our scientific understanding of the environment. Whether it be changes in our understanding of how ecosystems work, or changes in the evidence concerning the environmental crisis, it is clear that such change will inform and influence those thinkers writing on our environmental obligations.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Attfield, Robin, The Ethics of Environmental Concern, (Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1983).
  • Barry, Brian, “Sustainability and Intergenerational Justice” in Dobson, Andrew (ed.), Fairness and Futurity, (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999): 93-117.
  • Benson, John, Environmental Ethics: An Introduction with Readings, (London: Routledge, 2001).
  • Blackstone, William T., “Ethics and Ecology” in Blackstone, William T. (ed.), Philosophy and Environmental Crisis, (Athens, University of Georgia Press, 1972): 16-42.
  • Bookchin, Murray, The Ecology of Freedom: The Emergence and Dissolution of Hierarchy, (Palo Alto, CA: Cheshire Books, 1982).
  • Bookchin, Murray, “What is Social Ecology?” in, Boylan, Michael (ed.), Environmental Ethics, (New Jersey: Prentice Hall, 2001): 62-76.
  • Bookchin, Murray and Foreman, Dave, Defending the Earth, (New York: Black Rose Books, 1991).
  • Boylan, Michael (ed.), Environmental Ethics, (New Jersey: Prentice Hall, 2001).
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Author Information

Alasdair Cochrane
London School of Economics and Political Science
United Kingdom