Category Archives: Ethics

Locke: Ethics

LockeThe major writings of John Locke (1632–1704) are among the most important texts for understanding some of the central currents in epistemology, metaphysics, politics, religion, and pedagogy in the late 17th and early 18th century in Western Europe. His magnum opus, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1689) is the undeniable starting point for the study of empiricism in the early modern period. Locke’s best-known political text, Two Treatises of Government (1693) criticizes the political system according to which kings rule by divine right (First Treatise) and lays the foundation for modern liberalism (Second Treatise). His Letter Concerning Toleration (1689) argues that much civil unrest is borne of the state trying to prevent the practice of different religions. In this text, Locke suggests that the proper domain of government does not include deciding which religious path the people ought to take for salvation—in short, it is an argument for the separation of church and state. Some Thoughts Concerning Education (1693) is a very influential text in early modern Europe that outlines the best way to rear children. It suggests that the virtue of a person is directly related to the habits of body and the habits of mind instilled in them by their educators.

Although these texts enjoy a status of “must-reads,” Locke’s views on ethics or moral philosophy have nowhere near the same high status. The reason for this is, in large part, that Locke never wrote a text devoted to the topic. This omission is surprising given that several of his friends entreated him to set down his thoughts about ethics. They saw that the scattered remarks that Locke makes about morality here and there throughout his works were, at times, quite provocative and in need of further development and defense. But, for reasons unknown to us, Locke never indulged his friends with a more systematic moral philosophy. It is thus up to his readers to stitch together his fragmented remarks about happiness, moral laws, freedom, and virtue in order to see what kind of moral philosophy is woven through the texts and to determine whether it is a coherent position.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Good
    1. Pleasure and Pain
    2. Happiness
  3. The Law of Nature
    1. Existence
    2. Content
    3. Authority
    4. Reconciling the Law with Happiness
  4. Power, Freedom, and Suspending Desire
    1. Passive and Active Powers
    2. The Will
    3. Freedom
    4. Judgment
  5. Living the Moral Life
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources: Books
    3. Secondary Sources: Articles

1. Introduction

While Locke did not write a treatise devoted to a discussion of ethics, there are strands of discussion of morality that weave through many, if not most, of his works. One such strand is evident near the end of his An Essay Concerning Human Understanding (hereafter: Essay) where he states that one of the most important aspects of improving our knowledge is to recognize the kinds of things that we can truly know. With this recognition, he says, we are able to finely-tune the focus of our enquiries for optimal results. And, he concludes, given the natural capacities of human beings, “Morality is the proper Science, and Business of Mankind in general” because human beings are both “concerned” and “fitted to search out their Summum Bonum [highest good]” (Essay, Book IV, chapter xii, section 11; hereafter: Essay, IV.xii.11). This claim indicates that Locke takes the investigation of morality to be of utmost importance and gives us good reason to think that Locke’s analysis of the workings of human understanding in general is intimately connected to discovering how the science proper to humankind is to be practiced. The content of the knowledge of ethics includes information about what we, as rational and voluntary agents, ought to do in order to obtain an end, in particular, the end of happiness. It is the science, Locke says, of using the powers that we have as human beings in order to act in such a way that we obtain things that are good and useful for us. As he says: ethics is “the seeking out those Rules, and Measures of humane Actions, which lead to Happiness, and the Means to practice them” (Essay, IV.xxi.3). So, there are several elements in the landscape of Locke’s ethics: happiness or the highest good as the end of human action; the rules that govern human action; the powers that command human action; and the ways and means by which the rules are practiced. While Locke lays out this conception of ethics in the Essay, not all aspects of his definition are explored in detail in that text. So, in order to get the full picture of how he understands each element of his description of ethics, we must often look to several different texts where they receive a fuller treatment. This means that Locke himself does not explain how these elements fit together leaving his overarching theory somewhat of a puzzle for future commentators to contemplate. But, by mining different texts in this way, we can piece together the details of an ethical theory that, while not always obviously coherent, presents a depth and complexity that, at minimum, confirms that this is a puzzle worth trying to solve.

2. The Good

a. Pleasure and Pain

The thread of moral discussion that weaves most consistently throughout the Essay is the subject of happiness. True happiness, on Locke’s account, is associated with the good, which in turn is associated with pleasure. Pleasure, in its turn, is taken by Locke to be the sole motive for human action. This means that the moral theory that is most directly endorsed in the Essay is hedonism.

On Locke’s view, ideas come to us by two means: sensation and reflection. This view is the cornerstone of his empiricism. According to this theory, there is no such thing as innate ideas or ideas that are inborn in the human mind. All ideas come to us by experience. Locke describes sensation as the “great source” of all our ideas and as wholly dependent on the contact between our sensory organs and the external world. The other source of ideas, reflection or “internal sense,” is dependent on the mind’s reflecting on its own operations, in particular the “satisfaction or uneasiness arising from any thought” (Essay, II.i.4). What’s more, Locke states that pleasure and pain are joined to almost all of our ideas both of sensation and of reflection (Essay, II.vii.2). This means that our mental content is organized, at least in one way, by ideas that are associated with pleasure and ideas that are associated with pain. That our ideas are associated with pains and pleasures seems compatible with our phenomenal experience: the contact between the sense organ of touch and a hot stove will result in an idea of the hot stove annexed by the idea of pain, or the act of remembering a romantic first kiss brings with it the idea of pleasure. And, Locke adds, it makes sense to join our ideas to the ideas of pleasure and pain because if our ideas were not joined with either pleasure of pain, we would have no reason to prefer the doing of one action over another, or the consideration of one idea over another. If this were our situation, we would have no reason to act—either physically or mentally (Essay, II.viii.3). That pleasure and pain are given this motivational role in action entails that Locke endorses hedonism: the pursuit of pleasure and the avoidance of pain are the sole motives for action.

Locke notes that among all the ideas that we receive by sensation and reflection, pleasure and pain are very important. And, he notes that the things that we describe as evil are no more than the things that are annexed to the idea of pain, and the things that we describe as good are no more than the things that are annexed to the idea of pleasure. In other words, the presence of good or evil is nothing other than the way a particular idea relates to us—either pleasurably or painfully. This means that on Locke’s view, good is just the category of things that tend to cause or increase pleasure or decrease pain in us, and evil is just the category of things that tend to cause or increase pain or decrease pleasure in us (Essay, II.xx.2). Now, we might think that, morally speaking, this way of defining good and evil gets Locke into trouble. Consider the following scenario. Smith enjoys breaking her promises. In other words, failing to honor her word brings her pleasure. According to the view just described, it seems that breaking promises, at least for Smith, is a good. For, if good and evil are defined as nothing more than pleasure and pain, it seems that if something gives Smith pleasure, it is impossible to deny that it is a good. This would be an unwelcome effect of Locke’s view, for it would indicate that his system leads directly to a kind of moral relativism. If promise breaking is pleasurable for Smith and promise keeping is pleasurable for her friend Jones and pleasure is the sign of the good, then it seems that the good is relative and there is no sense in which we can say that Jones is right about what is good and Smith is wrong. Locke blocks this kind of consequence for his view by introducing a distinction between “happiness” and “true happiness.” This indicates that while all things that bring us pleasure are linked to happiness, there is also a category of pleasure-bringing things that are linked to true happiness. It is the pursuit of the members of this special category of pleasurable things that is, for Locke, emblematic of the correct use of our intellectual powers.

b. Happiness

Locke is very clear—we all constantly desire happiness. All of our actions, on his view, are oriented towards securing happiness. Uneasiness, Locke’s technical term for being in a state of pain and desirous of some absent good, is the motive that moves us to act in the way that is expected to relieve the pain of desire and secure the state of happiness (Essay, II.xxi.36). But, while Locke equates pleasure with good, he is careful to distinguish the happiness that is acquired as a result of the satisfaction of any particular desire and the true happiness that is the result of the satisfaction of a particular kind of desire. Drawing this distinction allows Locke to hold that the pursuit of a certain sets of pleasures or goods is more worthy than the pursuit of others.

The pursuit of true happiness, according to Locke, is equated with “the highest perfection of intellectual nature” (Essay, II.xxi.51). And, indeed, Locke takes our pursuit of this true happiness to be the thing to which the vast majority of our efforts should be oriented. To do this, he says that we need to try to match our desires to “the true instrinsick good” that is really within things. Notice here that Locke is implying that there is distinction to be drawn between the “true intrinsic good” of a thing and, it seems, the good that we unreflectively take to be within a certain thing. The idea here is that attentively considering a particular thing will allow us to see its true value as opposed to the superficial value we assign to a thing based on our immediate reaction to it. We can think, for example, of a bitter tasting medicine. A face-value assessment of the medicine will lead us to evaluate that the thing is to be avoided. However, more information and contemplation of it will lead us to see that the true worth of the medicine is, in fact, high and so it should be evaluated as a good to be pursued. And, Locke states, if we contemplate a thing long enough, and see clearly the measure of its true worth; we can change our desire and uneasiness for it in proportion to that worth (Essay, II.xxi.53). But how are we to understand Locke’s suggestion that there is a true, intrinsic good in things? So far, all he has said about the good is that it is tracked by pleasure. We begin to get an answer to this question when Locke acknowledges the obvious fact that different people derive pleasure and pain from different things. While he reiterates that happiness is no more than the possession of those things that give the most pleasure and the absence of those things that cause the most pain, and that the objects in these two categories can vary widely among people, he adds the following provocative statement:

 If therefore Men in this Life only have hope; if in this Life they can only enjoy, 'tis not strange, nor unreasonable, that they should seek their Happiness by avoiding all things, that disease them here, and by pursuing all that delight them; wherein it will be no wonder to find variety and difference. For if there be no Prospect beyond the Grave, the inference is certainly right, Let us eat and drink, let us enjoy what we delight in, for tomorrow we shall die [Isa, 22:13; I Cor. 15:32]. (Essay, II.xxi.55)

Here, Locke suggests that pursuing and avoiding the particular things that give us pleasure or pain would be a perfectly acceptable way to live were there “no prospect beyond the grave.” It seems that what Locke means is that if there were no judgment day, which is to say that if our actions were not ultimately judged by God, there would be no reason to do otherwise than to blindly follow our pleasures and flee our pains. Now, given this suggestion, the question, then, is how to distinguish between the things that are pleasurable but that will not help our case on judgment day, and those that will. Locke provides a clue for how to do such a thing when he says that the will is typically determined by those things that are judged to be good by the understanding. However, in many cases we use “wrong measures of good and evil” and end by judging unworthy things to be good. He who makes such a mistake errs because “[t]he eternal Law and Nature of things must not be alter’d to comply with his ill order’d choice” (Essay, II.xxi.56). In other words, there is an ordered way to choose which things to pursue—the things that are in accordance with the eternal law and nature of things—and an ill-ordered way, in accordance with our own palates. This indicates that Locke takes there to be a fixed law that determines which things are worthy of our pursuit, and which are not. This means that Locke takes there to be an important distinction between the good, understood as all objects that are connected to pleasure and the moral good, understood as objects connected to pleasure which are also in conformity with a law. Though the distinctions between good and moral good, and between evil and moral evil are not discussed in any great detail by Locke, he does states that moral good and evil is nothing other than the “Conformity or Disagreement of our voluntary Actions to some Law.” Locke states punishments and rewards are bestowed on us for our following or failure to follow this law by “the Will and Power of the Law-maker” (Essay, II.xxviii.5). So, Locke affirms that moral good and evil are closely tied to the observance or violation of some law, and that the lawmaker has the power to reward or punish those who adhere to or stray from the law.

3. The Law of Nature

a. Existence

In the Essay, the concepts of laws and lawmakers do not receive much treatment beyond Locke’s affirmation that God has decreed laws and that there are rewards and punishments associated with the respect or violation of these laws (Essay, I.iii.6; I.iii.12; II.xxi.70; II.xxviii.6). The two most important questions concerning the role of laws in a system of ethics remain unanswered in the Essay: (1) how do we determine the content of the law? This is the epistemological question. And (2) what kind of authority does the law have to obligate? This is the moral question. Locke spends much time considering these questions in a series of nine essays written some thirty years before the Essay, which are known under the collected title Essays on the Law of Nature (hereafter: Law).

The first essay in the series treats the question of whether there is a “rule of morals, or law of nature given to us.” The answer is unequivocally “yes” (Law, Essay I, page 109; hereafter: Law, I: 109). The reason for this positive answer, in short, is because God exists. Locke appeals to a kind of teleological argument to support the claim of God’s existence, saying that given the organization of the universe, including the organized way in which animal and vegetable bodies propagate, there must be a governing principle that is responsible for the patterns we see on earth. And, if we extend this principle to the existence of human life, Locke claims that it is reasonable to believe that there is a pattern or a law that governs behavior. This law is to be understood as moral good or virtue and, Locke states, it is the decree of God’s will and is discernable by “the light of nature.” Because the law tells us what is and is not in conformity with “rational nature,” it has the status of commanding or prohibiting certain behaviors (Law, I: 111; see also Essay, IV.xix.16). Because all human beings possess, by nature, the faculty of reason, all human beings, at least in principle, can discover the natural law.

Locke offers five reasons for thinking that such a natural law exists. He begins by noting that it is evident that there is some disagreement among people about the content of the law. However, far from thinking that such disagreement casts doubt on the existence of the law, he takes the presence of disagreement about the law as evidence that such a true and objective law exists. Disagreements about the content of the law confirm that everyone is in agreement about the fundamental character of the law—that there are things that are by their nature good or evil—but just disagree about how to interpret the law (Law, I: 115). The existence of the law is further reinforced by the fact that we often pass judgment on our own actions, by way of our conscience, leading to feelings of guilt or pride. Because it is not possible, according to Locke, to pronounce a judgment without the existence of a law, the act of conscience demonstrates that such a natural law exists. Third, again appealing to a kind of teleological argument, Locke states that we see that laws govern all manner of natural operations and that it makes sense that human beings would also be governed by laws that are in accordance with their nature (Law, I: 117). Fourth, Locke states that without the natural law, society would not be able to run the way that it does. He suggests that the force of civil law is grounded on the natural law. In other words, without the natural law, positive law would have no moral authority. Elsewhere, Locke underlines this point by saying that given that the law of nature is the eternal rule for all men, the rules made by legislators must conform to this law (The Two Treatises of Government, Treatise II, section 135, hereafter: Government, II.35). Finally, on Locke’s view, there would be no virtue or vice, no reward or punishment, no guilt, if there were no natural law (Law, I: 119). Without the natural law, there would be no bounds on human action. This means that we would be motivated only to do what seems pleasurable and there would be no sense in which anyone could be considered virtuous or vicious. The existence of the natural law, then, allows us to be sensitive to the fact that there are certain pleasures that are more in line with what is objectively right. Indeed, Locke also gestures towards, but does not elaborate on, this kind of thought in the Essay. He suggests that the studious man, who takes all his pleasures from reading and learning will eventually be unable to ignore his desires for food and drink. Likewise, the “Epicure,” whose only interest is in the sensory pleasures of food and drink, will eventually turn his attention to study when shame or the desire to “recommend himself to his Mistress” will raise his uneasiness for knowledge (Essay, II.xxi.43).

So, Locke has given us five reasons to accept the existence of the law of nature that grounds virtuous and vicious behavior. We turn now to how he thinks we come to know the content of the law.

b. Content

Locke suggests that there are two ways to determine the content of the law of nature: by the light of nature and by sense experience.

Locke is careful to note that by “light of nature” he does not mean something like an “inward light” that is “implanted in man” and like a compass constantly leads human beings towards virtue. Rather, this light is to be understood as a kind of metaphor that indicates that truth can be attained by each of us individually by nothing more than the exercise of reason and the intellectual faculties (Law, II: 123). Locke uses a comparison to precious metal mining to make this point clear. He acknowledges that some might say that his explanation of the discovery of the content of the law by the light of nature entails that everyone should always be in possession of the knowledge of this content. But, he notes, this is to take the light of nature as something that is stamped on the hearts on human beings, which is a mistake (see Law, III, 137-145). While the depths of the earth might contain veins of gold and silver, Locke says, this does not mean that everyone living on the stretch of land above those veins is rich (Law, II: 135). Work must be done to dig out the precious metals in order to benefit from their value. Similarly, proper use must be made of the faculties we have in order to benefit from the certainty provided by the light of nature. Locke notes that we can come to know the law of nature, in a way, by tradition, which is to say by the testimony and instruction of other people. But it is a mistake to follow the law for any reason other than that we recognize its universal binding force. This can only be done by our own intellectual investigation (Law, II: 129).

But what, exactly, is the light of nature? Locke acknowledges that it is difficult to answer this question—it is not something stamped on the heart or mind, nor is it something that is exclusively learned by tradition or testimony. The only option left for describing it, then, is that it is something acquired or experienced by sense experience or by reason. And, indeed, Locke suggests that when these two faculties, reason and sensation, work together, nothing can remain obscure to the mind. Sensation provides the mind with ideas and reason guides the faculty of sensation and arranges “together the images of things derived from sense-perception, thence forming others [ideas] and composing new ones” (Law, IV: 147). Locke emphasizes that reason ought to be taken to mean “the discursive faculty of the mind, which advances from things known to thinks unknown,” using as its foundation the data provided by sense experience (Law, IV: 149).

When directly addressing the question of how the combination of reason and sense experience allow us to know the content of the law of nature, Locke states that two important truths must be acknowledged because they are “presupposed in the knowledge of any and every law” (Law, IV: 151). First, we must understand that there is a lawmaker who decreed the law, and that the lawmaker is rightly obeyed as a superior power (a discussion of this point is also found in Government, I.81). Second, we must understand that the lawmaker wishes those to whom the law is decreed to follow the law. Let us take each of these in turn.

Sense experience allows us to know that a lawmaker exists. To demonstrate this, Locke appeals, once again, to a kind of teleological argument: by our senses we come to know the objects external world and, importantly, the regularities with which they move and change. We also see that we human beings are part of the movements and changes of the external world. Reason, then, contemplates these regularities and orders of change and motion and naturally comes to inquire about their origin. The conclusion of such an inquiry, states Locke, is that a powerful and wise creator exists. This conclusion follows from two observations: (1) that beasts and inanimate things cannot be the cause of the existence of human beings because they are clearly less perfect than human beings, and something less perfect cannot bring more perfect things into existence, and 2) that we ourselves cannot be the cause of our own existence because if we possessed the power to create ourselves, we would also have the power to give ourselves eternal life. Because it is obviously the case that we do not have eternal life, Locke concludes that we cannot be the origin of our own existence. So, Locke says, there must be a powerful agent, God, who is the origin of our existence (Law, IV: 153). The senses provide the data from the external world, and reason contemplates the data and concludes that a creator of the observed objects and phenomena must exist. Once the existence of a creator is determined, Locke thinks that we can also see that the creator has “a just and inevitable command over us and at His pleasure can raise us up or throw us down, and make us by the same commanding power happy or miserable” (Law, IV: 155). This commanding power, on Locke’s view, indicates that we are necessarily subject to the decrees of God’s will. (A similar line of discussion is found in Locke’s The Reasonableness of Christianity, 144–46.)

As for the second truth, that the lawmaker, God, wishes us to follow the laws decreed, Locke states that once we see that there is a creator of all things and that an order obtains among them, we see that the creator is both powerful and wise. It follows from these evident attributes that God would not create something without a purpose. Moreover, we notice that our minds and bodies seem well equipped for action, which suggests, “God intends man to do something.” And, the “something” that we are made to do, according to Locke, is the same purpose shared by all created things—the glorification of God (Law, IV: 157). In the case of rational beings, Locke states that given our nature, our function is to use sense experience and reason in order to discover, contemplate, and praise God’s creation; to create a society with other people and to work to maintain and preserve both oneself and the community. And this, in fact, is the content of the law of nature—to preserve one’s own being and to work to maintain and preserve the beings of the other people in our community. This injunction to preserve oneself and to preserve one’s neighbors is also endorsed and stressed throughout Locke’s discussions of political power and freedom (see Government, I.86, 88, 120; II.6, 25, 128).

c. Authority

Once we have knowledge of the content of the law of nature, we must determine from where it derives its authority. In other words, we must ask why we are bound to follow the law once we are aware of its content. Locke begins this discussion by reiterating that the law of nature “is the care and preservation of oneself.” Given this law, he states that virtue should not be understood as a duty but rather the “convenience” of human beings. In this sense, the good is nothing more than what is useful. Further, he adds, the observance of this law is not so much an obligation but rather “a privilege and an advantage, to which we are led by expediency” (Law, VI: 181). This indicates that Locke thinks that actions that are in conformity with the law are useful and practical. In other words, it is in our best interest to follow the law. While this characterization of why we in fact follow the law is compelling, there is nevertheless still an inquiry to be made into why we ought to follow the law.

Locke begins his treatment of this question by stating that no one can oblige us to do anything unless the one who obliges has some superior right and power over us. The obligation that is generated between such a superior power and those who are subject to it results in two kinds of duties: (1) the duty to pay obedience to the command of the superior power. Because our faculties are suited to discover the existence of the divine lawmaker, Locke takes it to be impossible to avoid this discovery, barring some damage or impediment to our faculties. This duty is ultimately grounded in God’s will as the force by which we were created (Law, VI: 183). (2) The duty to suffer punishment as a result of the failure to honor the first duty—obedience. Now, it might seem odd that it would be necessary to postulate that punishment results from the failure to respect a law the content of which is only that we must take care of ourselves. In other words, how could anyone express so little interest in taking care of himself or herself that the fear of punishment is needed to motivate the actions necessary for such care? It is worth quoting Locke’s answer in full:

[A] liability to punishment, which arises from a failure to pay dutiful obedience, so that those who refuse to be led by reason and to own that in the matter of morals and right conduct they are subject to a superior authority may recognize that they are constrained by force and punishment to be submissive to that authority and feel the strength of Him whose will they refuse to follow. And so the force of this obligation seems to be grounded in the authority of a lawmaker, so that power compels those who cannot be moved by warnings. (Law, VI: 183)

So, even though the existence, content, and authority of the law of nature are known in virtue of the faculties possessed by all rational creatures—sense experience and reason—Locke recognizes that there are people who “refuse to be led by reason.” Because these people do not see the binding force of the law by their faculties alone, they need some other impetus to motivate their behavior. But, Locke thinks very ill of those who are in need of this other impetus. He says the these features of the law of nature can be discovered by anyone who is diligent about directing their mind to them, and can be concealed from no one “unless he loves blindness and darkness and casts off nature in order that he may avoid his duty” (Law, VI: 189, see also Government, II.6).

d. Reconciling the Law with Happiness

The main lines of Locke’s natural law theory are as follows: there is a moral law that is (1) discoverable by the combined work of reason and sense experience, and (2) binding on human beings in virtue of being decreed by God. Now, in §1 above, we saw that Locke thinks that all human beings are naturally oriented to the pursuit of happiness. This is because we are motivated to pursue things if they promise pleasure and to avoid things if they promise pain. It has seemed to many commentators that these two discussions of moral principles are in tension with each other. On the view described in Law, Locke straightforwardly appeals to reason and our ability to understand the nature of God’s attributes to ground our obligation to follow the law of nature. In other words, what is lawful ought to be followed because God wills it and what is unlawful ought to be rejected because it is not willed by God. Because we can straightforwardly see that God is the law-giver and that we are by nature subordinate to Him, we ought to follow the law. By contrast, in the discussion of happiness and pleasure in the Essay, Locke explains that good and evil reduce to what is pleasurable and what is painful. While he does also indicate that the special categories of good and evil—moral good and moral evil—are no more than the conformity or disagreement between our actions and a law, he immediately adds that such conformity or disagreement is followed by rewards or punishments that flow from the lawmaker’s will. From this discussion, then, it is difficult to see whether Locke holds that it is the reward and punishment that binds human beings to act in accordance with the law, or if it is the fact that the law is willed by God.

One way to approach this problem is to suggest that Locke changed his mind. Because of the thirty-year gap between Law and the Essay, we might be tempted to think that the more rationalist picture, where the law and its authority are based on reason, was the young Locke’s view when he wrote Law. This view, the story would go, was replaced by Locke’s more considered and mature view, hedonism. But this approach must be resisted because both theories are present in early and late works. The role of pleasure and pain with respect to morality is present not only in the Essay, but is invoked in Law (passage quoted at the end of §2c), and many other various minor essays written in the years between Law and Essay (for example, ‘Morality’ (c.1677–78) in Political Essays, 267–69). Likewise, the role of the authority of God's will is retained after Law, again evident in various minor essays (for example, ‘Virtue B’ (1681) in Political Essays, 287-88), Government II.6), Locke’s correspondence (for example, to James Tyrrell, 4 August 1690, Correspondence, Vol.4, letter n.1309) and even in the Essay itself (II.xxviii.8). An answer to how we might reconcile these two positions is suggested when we consider the texts where appeals to both theories are found side-by-side in certain passages.

In his essay Of Ethick in General (c. 1686–88) Locke affirms the hedonist view that happiness and misery consist only in pleasure and pain, and that we all naturally seek happiness. But in the very next paragraph, he states that there is an important difference between moral and natural good and evil—the pleasure and pain that are consequences of virtuous and vicious behavior are grounded in the divine will. Locke notes that drinking to excess leads to pain in the form of headache or nausea. This is an example of a natural evil. By contrast, transgressing a law would not have any painful consequences if the law were not decreed by a superior lawmaker. He adds that it is impossible to motivate the actions of rational agents without the promise of pain or pleasure (Of Ethick in General, §8). From these considerations, Locke suggests that the proper foundation of morality, a foundation that will entail an obligation to moral principles, needs two things. First, we need the proof of a law, which presupposes the existence of a lawmaker who is superior to those to whom the law is decreed. The lawmaker has the right to ordain the law and the power to reward and punish. Second, it must be shown that the content of the law is discoverable to humankind (Of Ethick in General, §12). In this text it seems that Locke suggests that both the force and authority of the divine decree and the promise of reward and punishment are necessary for the proper foundation of an obligating moral law.

A similar line of argument is found in the Essay. There, Locke asserts that in order to judge moral success or failure, we need a rule by which to measure and judge action. Further, each rule of this sort has an “enforcement of Good and Evil.” This is because, according to Locke, “where-ever we suppose a Law, suppose also some Reward or Punishment annexed to that Law” (Essay, II.xxviii.6). Locke states that some promise of pleasure or pain is necessary in order to determine the will to pursue or avoid certain actions. Indeed, he puts the point even more strongly, saying that it would be in vain for the intelligent being who decrees the rule of law to so decree without entailing reward or punishment for the obedient or the unfaithful (see also Government, II.7). It seems, then, that reason discovers the fact that a divine law exists and that it derives from the divine will and, as such, is binding. We might think, as Stephen Darwall suggests in The British Moralists and the Internal Ought, that if reason is that which discovers our obligation to the law, the role for reward and punishment is to motivate our obedience to the law. While this succeeds in making room for both the rationalist and hedonist strains in Locke’s view, some other texts seem to indicate that by reason alone we ought to be motivated to follow moral laws.

One striking instance of this kind of suggestion is found in the third book of the Essay where Locke boldly states that “Morality is capable of Demonstration” in the same way as mathematics (Essay, III.xi.16). He explains that once we understand the existence and nature of God as a supreme being who is infinite in power, goodness, and wisdom and on whom we depend, and our own nature “as understanding, rational Beings,” we should be able to see that these two things together provide the foundation of both our duty and the appropriate rules of action. On Locke’s view, with focused attention the measures of right and wrong will become as clear to us as the propositions of mathematics (Essay, IV.iii.18). He gives two examples of such certain moral principles to make the point: (1) “Where there is no Property, there is no Injustice” and (2) “No Government allows absolute Liberty.” He explains that property implies a right to something and injustice is the violation of a right to something. So, if we clearly see the intensional definition of each term, we see that (1) is necessarily true. Similarly, government indicates the establishment of a society based on certain rules, and absolute liberty is the freedom from any and all rules. Again, if we understand the definitions of the two terms in the proposition, it becomes obvious that (2) is necessarily true. And, Locke states, following this logic, 1 and 2 are as certain as the proposition that “a Triangle has three Angles equal to two right ones” (Essay, IV.iii.18). If moral principles have the same status as mathematical principles, it is difficult to see why we would need further inducement to use these principles to guide our behavior. While there is no clear answer to this question, Locke does provide a way to understand the role of reward and punishment in our obligation to moral principles despite the fact that it seems that they ought to obligate by reason alone.

Early in the Essay, over the course of giving arguments against the existence of innate ideas, Locke addresses the possibility of innate moral principles. He begins by saying that for any proposed moral rule human beings can, with good reason, demand justification. This precludes the possibility of innate moral principles because, if they were innate, they would be self-evident and thus would not be candidates for justification. Next, Locke notes that despite the fact that there are no innate moral principles, there are certain principles that are undeniable, for example, that “men should keep their Compacts.” However, when asked why people follow this rule, different answers are given. A “Hobbist” will say that it is because the public requires it, and the “Leviathan” will punish those who disobey the law. A “Heathen” philosopher will say that it is because following such a law is a virtue, which is the highest perfection for human beings. But a Christian philosopher, the category to which Locke belongs, will say that it is because “God, who has the Power of eternal Life and Death, requires it of us” (Essay, I.iii.5). Locke builds on this statement in the following section when he notes that while the existence of God and the truth of our obedience to Him is made manifest by the light of reason, it is possible that there are people who accept the truth of moral principles, and follow them, without knowing or accepting the “true ground of Morality; which can only be the Will and Law of God” (Essay, I.iii.6). Here Locke is suggesting that we can accept a true moral law as binding and follow it as such, but for the wrong reasons. This means that while the Hobbist, the Heathen, and the Christian might all take the same law of keeping one’s compacts to be obligating, only the Christian does it for the right reason—that God’s will requires our obedience to that law. Indeed, Locke states that if we receive truths by revelation they too must be subject to reason, for to follow truths based on revelation alone is insufficient (see Essay, IV.xviii).

Now, to determine the role of pain and pleasure in this story, we turn to Locke’s discussion of the role of pain and pleasure in general. He says that God has joined pains and pleasures to our interaction with many things in our environment in order to alert us to things that are harmful or helpful to the preservation of our bodies (Essay, II.vii.4). But, beyond this, Locke notes that there is another reason that God has joined pleasure and pain to almost all our thoughts and sensations: so that we experience imperfections and dissatisfactions. He states that the kinds of pleasures that we experience in connection to finite things are ephemeral and not representative of complete happiness. This dissatisfaction coupled with the natural drive to obtain happiness opens the possibility of our being led to seek our pleasure in God, where we anticipate a more stable and, perhaps, permanent happiness. Appreciating this reason why pleasure and pain are annexed to most of our ideas will, according to Locke, lead the way to the ultimate aim of the enquiry in human understanding—the knowledge and veneration of God (Essay, II.vii.5–6). So, Locke seems to be suggesting here that pain and pleasure prompt us to find out about God, in whom complete and eternal happiness is possible. This search, in turn, leads us to knowledge of God, which will include the knowledge that He ought to be obeyed in virtue of His decrees alone. Pleasure and pain, reward and punishment, on this interpretation, are the means by which we are led to know God’s nature, which, once known, motivates obedience to His laws. This mechanism supports Locke’s claim that real happiness is to be found in the perfection of our intellectual nature—in embarking on the search for knowledge of God, we embark on the intellectual journey that will lead to the kind of knowledge that brings permanent pleasure. This at least suggests that the knowledge of God has the happy double-effect of leading to both more stable happiness and the understanding that God is to be obeyed in virtue of His divine will alone.

But given that all human beings experience pain and pleasure, Locke needs to explain how it is that certain people are virtuous, having followed the experience of dissatisfaction to arrive at the knowledge of God, and other people are vicious, who seek pleasure and avoid pain for no reason other than their own hedonic sensations.

4. Power, Freedom, and Suspending Desire

a. Passive and Active Powers

In any discussion of ethics, it is important not only to determine what, exactly, counts as virtuous and vicious behavior, but also the extent to which we are in control of our actions. This is important because we want to be able to adequately connect behavior to agents in order to attribute praise or blame, reward or punishment to an agent, we need to be able to see the way in which she is the causal source of her own actions. Locke addresses this issue in one of the longest chapters of the Essay—“Of Power.” In this chapter, Locke describes how he understands the nature of power, the human will, freedom and its connection to happiness, and, finally, the reasons why many (or even most) people do not exercise their freedom in the right kind of way and are unhappy as a result. It is worth noting here that this chapter of the Essay underwent major revisions throughout the five editions of the Essay and in particular between the first and second edition. The present discussion is based on the fourth edition of the Essay (but see the “References and Further Reading” below for articles that discuss the relevance of the changes throughout all five editions).

Locke states that we come to have the idea of “power” by observing the fact that things change over time. Finite objects are changed as a result of interactions with other finite objects (for example fire melts gold) and we notice that our own ideas change either as a result of external stimulus (for example the noise of a jackhammer interrupts the contemplation of a logic problem) or as a result of our own desires (for example hunger interrupts the contemplation of a logic problem). The idea of power always includes some kind of relation to action or change. The passive side of power entails the ability to be changed and the active side of power entails the ability to make change. Our observation of almost all sensible things furnishes us with the idea of passive power. This is because sensible things appear to be in almost constant flux—they are changed by their interaction with other sensible things, with heat, cold, rain, and time. And, Locke adds, such observations give us no fewer instances of the idea of active power, for “whatever Change is observed, the Mind must collect a Power somewhere, able to make that Change” (Essay, II.xxi.4). However, when it comes to active powers, Locke states that the clearest and most distinct idea of active power comes to us from the observation of the operations of our own minds. He elaborates by stating that there are two kinds of activities with which we are familiar: thinking and motion. When we consider body in general, Locke states that it is obvious that we receive no idea of thinking, which only comes from a contemplation of the operations of our own minds. But neither does body provide the idea of the beginning of motion, only of the continuation or transfer of motion. The idea of the beginning of motion, which is the idea associated with the active power of motion, only comes to us when we reflect “on what passes in our selves, where we find by Experience, that barely by willing it, barely by a thought of the Mind, we can move the parts of our Bodies, which were before at rest” (Essay, II.xxi.4). So, it seems, the operation of our minds, in particular the connection between one kind of thought, willing, and a change in either the content of our minds or the orientation of our bodies, provides us with the idea of an active power.

b. The Will

The power to stop, start, or continue an action of the mind or of the body is what Locke calls the will. When the power of the will is exercised, a volition (or willing) occurs. Any action (or forbearance of action) that follows volition is considered voluntary. The power of the will is coupled with the power of the understanding. This latter power is defined as the power of perceiving ideas and their agreement or disagreement with one another. The understanding, then, provides ideas to the mind and the will, depending on the content of these ideas, prefers certain courses of action to others. Locke explains that the will directs action according to its preference—and here we must understand “preference” in the most general sense of inclination, partiality, or taste. In short, the will is attracted to actions that promise the procurement of pleasing things and/or the distancing from displeasing things. The technical term that Locke uses to describe that which determines the will is uneasiness. He elaborates, stating that the reason why any action is continued is “the present satisfaction in it” and the reason why any action is taken to move to a new state is dissatisfaction (Essay, II.xxi.29). Indeed, Locke affirms that uneasiness, at bottom, is really no more than desire, where the mind is disturbed by a “want of some absent good” (Essay, II.xxi.31). So, any pain or discomfort of the mind or body is a motive for the will to command a change of state so as to move from unease to ease. Locke notes that it is a common fact of life that we often experience multiple uneasinesses at one time, all pressing on us and demanding relief. But, he says, when we ask the question of what determines the will at any one moment, the answer is the most pressing uneasiness (Essay, II.xxi.31). Imagine a situation where you are simultaneously experiencing discomfort as a result of hunger and the anxiety of being under-prepared for tomorrow’s philosophy exam. On Locke’s view the most intense or the most pressing of these uneasinesses will determine your will to command the action that will relieve it. This means that no matter how much you want to stay at the library to study, if hunger comes to be the more pressing than the desire to pass the exam, hunger will determine the will to act, commanding the action that will result in the procurement of food.

While Locke states that the most pressing uneasiness determines the will, he adds that it does so “for the most part, but not always.” This is because he takes the mind to have the power to “suspend the execution and satisfaction of any of its desires” (Essay, II.xxi.47). While a desire is suspended, Locke says, our mind, being temporarily freed from the discomfort of the want for the thing desired, has the opportunity to consider the relative worth of that thing. The idea here is that with appropriate deliberation about the value of the desired thing we will come to see which things are really worth pursuing and which are better left alone. And, Locke states, the conclusion at which we arrive after this intellectual endeavor of consideration and examination will indicate what, exactly, we take to be part of our happiness. And, in turn, by a mechanism that Locke does not describe in any detail, our uneasiness and desire for that thing will change to reflect whether we concluded that the thing does, indeed, play a role in our happiness or not (Essay, II.xxi.56). The problem is that there is no clear explanation for how, exactly, the power to suspend works. Despite this, Locke nowhere indicates that suspension is an action of the mind that is determined by anything other than volition of the will. We know that Locke takes all acts of the will to be determined by uneasiness. So, suspending our desires must be the result of uneasiness for something. Investigating how Locke understands human freedom and judgment will allow us to see what, exactly, we are uneasy for when we are determined to suspend our desires.

c. Freedom

When the nature of the human will is under discussion, we often want to know the extent of this faculty’s freedom. The reason why this question is important is because we want to see how autonomously the will can act. Typically, the question takes the form of: is the will free? Locke unequivocally denies that the will is free, implying, in fact, that it is a category mistake to ask the question at all. This is because, on his view, both the will and freedom are powers of agents, and it is a mistake to think that one power (the will) can have as a property a second power (freedom) (Essay, II.xxi.20). Instead, Locke thinks that the right question to pose is whether the agent is free. He defines freedom in the following way:

[T]he Idea of Liberty, is the Idea of a Power in any Agent to do or forbear any particular Action, according to the determination or thought of the mind, whereby either of them is preferr’d to the other; where either of them is not in the Power of the Agent to be produced by him according to his Volition here he is not a Liberty, that Agent is under Necessity. (Essay, II.xxi.8)

So, Locke considers that an agent is free in acting when her action is connected to her volition in the right kind of way. That is, when her action (or forbearance of action) follows from her volition, she is free. And, her volition is determined by the “thought of the mind” that indicates which action is preferred.

Notice here that Locke takes an agent to be free in acting when she acts according to her preference—this means that her actions are determined by her preference. This plainly shows that Locke does not endorse a kind of freedom of indifference, according to which the will can choose to command an action other than the thing most preferred at a given moment. This is the kind of freedom most often associated with indeterminism. Freedom, then, for Locke, is no more than the ability to execute the action that is taken to result in the most pleasure at a given moment. The problem with this way of defining freedom is that it seems unable to account for the kinds of actions we typically take to be emblematic of virtuous or vicious behavior. This is because we tend to think that the power of freedom is a power that allows us to avoid vicious actions, perhaps especially those that are pleasurable, in order to pursue a righteous path instead. For instance, on the traditional Christian picture, when we wonder about why God would allow Adam to sin, the response given is that Adam was created as a free being. While God could have created beings that, like automata, unfailingly followed the good and the true, He saw that it was all things considered better to create beings that were free to choose their own actions. This decision was made despite the fact that God foresaw the sinful use to which this freedom would be put. This traditional view explains Adam’s sin in the following way: Adam knew that it was God’s commandment that he was not to eat of the tree of knowledge. Adam also knew that following God’s commandment was the right thing to do. So, in the moment where he was tempted to eat the fruit of the tree of knowledge, he knew it was the wrong thing to do, but did it anyway. This is because, the story goes, and in that moment he was free to decide whether to follow the commandment or to give in to temptation. Of his own free choice, Adam decided to follow temptation. This means that in the moment of original sin, both following God’s commandment and eating the fruit were live options for Adam, and he chose the fruit of his own agency.

Now, on Locke’s system, a different explanation obtains. Given his definition of freedom, it is difficult, at least prima facie, to see how Adam could be blamed for choosing the fruit over the commandment. For, according to Locke, an agent acts freely when her actions are determined by her volitions. So, if Adam’s greatest uneasiness was for the fruit, and the act of eating the fruit was the result of his will commanding such action based on his preference, then he acted freely. But, on this understanding of freedom, it is difficult to see how, exactly, Adam can be morally blamed for eating the fruit. The question now becomes: is Adam to be blamed for anticipating more pleasure from the consumption of the fruit than from following God’s command? In other words, was it possible for Adam to alter the intensity of his desire for the fruit? It seems that on Locke’s view, the answer must be connected to one of the powers he takes human beings to possess—the power to suspend desires. And, in certain passages of the Essay, Locke implies that suspending desires and freedom are linked, suggesting that while agents are acting freely whenever their volitions and actions are linked in the right kind of way, there is, perhaps, a proper use of the power to act freely.

d. Judgment

Locke asserts that the “highest perfection of intellectual nature” is the “pursuit of true and solid happiness.” He adds that taking care not to mistake imaginary happiness for real happiness is “the necessary foundation of our liberty.” And, he writes that the more closely we are focused on the pursuit of true happiness, which is our greatest good, the less our wills are determined to command actions to pursue lesser goods that are not representative of the true good (Essay, II.xxi.51). In other words, the more we are determined by true happiness, the more we will to suspend our desires for lesser things. This suggests that Locke takes there to be a right way to use our power of freedom. Locke indicates that there are instances where it is impossible to resist a particular desire—when a violent passion strikes, for instance. He also states, however, that aside from these kinds of violent passions, we are always able to suspend our desire for any thing in order to give ourselves the time and the emotional distance from the thing desired in which to consider the worth of thing relative to our general goal: true happiness. True happiness, or real bliss, on Locke’s view, is to be found in the pursuit of things that are true intrinsic goods, which promise “exquisite and endless Happiness” in the next life (Essay, II.xxi.70). In other words, true good is something like the Beatific Vision.

Now, Locke admits that it is a common experience to be carried by our wills towards things that we know do not play a role in our overall and true happiness. However, while he allows that the pursuit of things that promise pleasure, even if only a temporary pleasure, represents the action of a free agent, he also says that it is possible for us to be “at Liberty in respect of willing” when we choose “a remote Good as an end to be pursued” (Essay, II.xxi.56). The central thing to note here is that Locke is drawing a distinction between immediate and remote goods. The difference between these two kinds of goods is temporal. For instance, acting to obtain the pleasure of intoxication is to pursue an immediate good while acting to obtain the pleasure of health is to pursue a remote good. So, we can suppose here that Locke is suggesting that forgoing immediate goods and privileging remote goods is characteristic of the right use of liberty (but see Rickless for an alternative interpretation). If this is so, it is certainly not a difficult suggestion to accept. Indeed, it is fairly straightforwardly clear that many immediate pleasures do not, in the end, contribute to overall and long-lasting happiness.

The question now, and it is a question that Locke himself poses, is “How Men come often to prefer the worse to the better; and to chase that, which, by their own Confession, has made them miserable” (Essay, II.xxi.56). Locke gives two answers. First, bad luck can account for people not pursuing their true happiness. For instance, someone who is afflicted with an illness, injury, or tragedy is consumed by her pain and is thus unable to adequately focus on remote pleasures. Quoting Locke’s second answer “Other uneasinesses arise from our desire of absent good; which desires always bear proportion to, and depend on the judgment we make, and the relish we have of any absent good; in both which we are apt to be variously misled, and that by our own fault” (Essay, II.xxi.57).

Here Locke states that our own faulty judgment is to blame for our preferring the worse to the better. This is because, on his view, the uneasiness we have for any given object is directly proportional to the judgments we make about the merit of the things to which we are attracted. So, if we are most uneasy for immediate pleasures, it is our own fault because we have judged these things to be best for us. In this way, Locke makes room in his system for praiseworthiness and blameworthiness with respect to our desires: absent illness, injury, or tragedy, we ourselves are responsible for endorsing, through judgment, our uneasinesses. He continues, stating that the major reason why we often misjudge the value of things for our true happiness is that our current state fools us into thinking that we are, in fact, truly happy. Because it is difficult for us to consider the state of true, eternal happiness, we tend to think that in those moments when we enjoy pleasure and feel no uneasiness, we are truly happy. But such thoughts are mistaken on his view. Indeed, as Locke says, the greatest reason why so few people are moved to pursue the greatest, remote good is that most people are convinced that they can be truly happy without it.

The cause of our mistaken judgments is the fact that it is very difficult for us to compare present and immediate pleasures and pains with future or remote pleasures and pains. In fact, Locke likens this difficulty to the trouble we typically experience in correctly estimating the size of distant objects. When objects are close to us, it is easy to determine their size. When they are far away, it is much more difficult. Likewise, he says, for pleasures and pains. He notes that if every sip of alcohol were accompanied by headache and nausea, no one would ever drink. But, “the fallacy of a little difference in time” provides the space for us to mistakenly judge that the alcohol contributes to our true happiness (Essay, II.xxi.63). We experience this difficulty of judging remote pleasures and pains due to the “weak and narrow Constitution of our Minds” (Essay, II.xxi.64). The condition of our minds makes it easy for us to think that there could be no greater good than the relief of being unburdened of a present pain. In order to correct this problem and convince a man to judge that his greatest good is to be found in a remote thing, Locke says that all we must do is convince him that “Virtue and Religion are necessary to his Happiness” (Essay, II.xxi.60). Locke explains that a “due consideration will do it in most cases; and practice, application, and custom in most” (Essay, II.xxi.69). The suggestion is that contemplation and deliberation alone may be sufficient to correct our problem of considering all immediate pleasures and pains to be greater than any future ones. And, if that does not work, practice and habit can also correct this problem. By practice and exposure, we can, according to Locke, change the agreeableness or disagreeableness of things. It seems, then, that the power to suspend desire must be the power to reject immediate pleasures in favor of the pursuit of remote or future pleasures. However, it seems that in order to suspend in this way, we must already have judged that these immediate pleasures are not representative of the true good. For, without this kind of prior judgment, it seems that we would not be in a position to suspend in the way that is required. This is because absent the prior judgment, there would be no reason for the uneasiness we felt for the perceived good to not determine the will. The question to resolve now is how to get ourselves into a position where we are uneasy for the remote, true good and can suspend our desires for immediate pleasures. In other words, we must determine how we can come to seriously judge immediate pleasures to not have a part in our true happiness.

5. Living the Moral Life

In order to behave in a way that will lead us to the greatest and truest happiness, we must come to judge the remote and future good, the “unspeakable,” “infinite,” and “eternal” joys of heaven to be our greatest and thus most pleasurable good (Essay, II.xxi.37–38). But, on Locke’s view, our actions are always determined by the thing we are most uneasy about at any given moment. So, it seems, we need to cultivate the uneasiness for the infinite joys of heaven. But if, as Locke suggests, the human condition is such that our minds, in their weak and narrow states, judge immediate pleasures to be representative of the greatest good, it is difficult to see how, exactly, we can circumvent this weakened state in order to suspend our more terrestrial desires and thus have the space to correctly judge which things will lead to our true happiness. While in the Essay Locke does not say as much as we might like on this topic, elsewhere in his writings we can get a sense for how he might respond to this question.

In 1684, Locke was asked by his friend Edward Clarke, for advice about raising and educating his children. In 1693, Locke’s musings on this topic were published as Some Thoughts Concerning Education (hereafter: Education). This text provides insight into the importance that Locke places on the connection between the pursuit of true happiness and early childhood education in general. Locke begins his discussion by noting that happiness is crucially dependent on the existence of both a sound mind and a sound body. He adds that it sometimes happens that by a great stroke of luck, someone is born whose constitution is so strong that they do not need help from others to direct their minds towards the things that will make them happy. But this is an extraordinarily rare occurrence. Indeed, Locke notes: “I think I may say, that, of all the men we meet with, nine parts of ten are what they are, good or evil, useful or not, by their education” (Education, §1). It is the education we receive as young children, on Locke’s view, that determines how adept we are at targeting the right objects in order to secure our happiness. He observes that the minds of young children are easily distracted by all kinds of sensory stimuli and notes that the first step to developing a mind that is focused on the right kind of things is to ensure that the body is healthy. Indeed, the objective in physical health is to get the body in the perfect state to be able to obey and carry out the mind’s commands. The more difficult part of this equation is training the mind to “be disposed to consent to nothing, but what may be suitable to the dignity and excellency of a rational creature” (Education, §31). And Locke goes further still, stating that the foundation of all virtue is to be placed in the ability of a human being to “deny himself his own desires, cross his own inclinations, and purely follow what reason directs as best, though the appetite lean the other way” (Education, §33). The way to do this, he says, is to resist immediately present pleasures and pains and to wait to act until reason has determined the value of the desirable things in one’s environment.

Locke states that we must recognize the difference between “natural wants” and “wants of fancy.” The former are the kinds of desires that must be obeyed and that no amount of reasoning will allow us to give up. The latter, however, are created. Locke states that parents and teachers must ensure that children develop the habit of resisting any kind of created fancy, thus keeping the mind free from desires for things that do not lead to true happiness (Education, §107). If parents and teachers are successful in blocking the development of “wants of fancy,” Locke thinks that the children who benefit from this success will become adults who will be “allowed greater liberty” because they will be more closely connected to the dictates of reason and not the dictates of passion (Education, §108). So, in order to live the moral life and listen to reason over passions, it seems that we need to have had the benefit of conscientious care-givers in our infancy and youth (see also Government, II.63). This raises the difficulty of how to connect an individual’s moral successes or failures with the individual herself. For, if she had the bad moral luck of unthinking or careless parents and teachers, it seems difficult to see how she could be blamed for failing to follow a virtuous path.

One way of approaching this difficulty is to recall that Locke takes the content of law of nature, the moral law decreed by God, to be the preservation both of ourselves and of the other people in our communities in order to glorify God (Law, IV). The dictate to help to preserve the other people in our community shifts some of the moral burden from the individual onto the community. This means that it is every individual’s responsibility to do all they can, all things considered, to preserve themselves and to ensure, to the best of their ability, that the children in their communities are raised to avoid developing wants of fancy. In this way, children will develop the habit of suspending their desires for terrestrial pleasures and focusing their efforts on attaining the true happiness that results from acting to secure remote goods.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Edited by Peter H. Nidditch. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
    • This is the critical edition of Locke’s Essay. The body of the text is based on the fourth edition of the Essay and all the changes from the first edition through the fifth (1689, 1694, 1695, 1700, 1706) are indicated in the footnotes. The text also includes a comprehensive forward by Nidditch. Note that Locke’s orthography, grammar, and style are often quite different from the way that academic English is written today. In the citations from this text in particular, all emphases, capitalization, and odd spelling are original to Locke.
  • Essays on the Laws of Nature. Edited and translated by W. von Leyden. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1954.
    • This edition includes both the original Latin and the English translation of the essays. It also includes Locke’s valedictory speech as censor of moral philosophy at Christ Church and some other shorter pieces of writing. Von Leyden’s introduction provides a very detailed discussion of the sources of Locke’s arguments in these essays, the arguments themselves, and the relations these arguments bear to other of Locke’s writings. It is worth noting here that on von Leyden’s interpretation, it is not possible to render Locke’s discussion of natural law consistent with his endorsement of a hedonistic motivational system in later works.
  • Political Essays. Edited by Mark Goldie. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
    • This collection includes major writings on politics and government, including Essays on the Laws of Nature, Of Ethick in General, and An Essay on Toleration, in addition to many other minor essays.
  • The Correspondence of John Locke, in Eight Volumes. Edited by E.S. De Beer. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1976–89.
    • A complete database of Locke’s correspondence including notes about his correspondents, notes about events and proper names mentioned in letters, as well as signposts for what was going on in Locke’s life at the time he was writing. The first volume of the collection includes an exhaustive introduction to Locke’s life, work, and contacts in the academic and social world; an explanation of how Locke’s letters were preserved; a discussion of previous publications of Locke’s correspondence and how they relate to this collection; and information about transcription practices, including details about editorial grammar decision and dating of the letters.
  • The Works of John Locke, in Nine Volumes, 12th edition. London: Rivington, 1824.
    • This collection includes most of Locke’s longer texts, some shorter texts and a selection of letters. Among other things, the collection contains: Essay (vols.1 and 2), his correspondence with Stillingfleet (vol.3), Two Treatises of Government (vol.4), Letters on Toleration (vol.5), The Reasonableness of Christianity (vol.6), notes on St. Paul's Epistles (vol.7), Some Thoughts Concerning Education and A Discourse of Miracles (vol.8), and a selection of letters (vol.9).

b. Secondary Sources: Books

  • Aaron, Richard I. John Locke. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1971.
    • This is a comprehensive study of Locke’s life and works and includes fifteen very nice pages on Locke’s moral philosophy. Importantly, Aaron concludes that Locke fails to provide his readers  with a science of morals and, in fact, that Locke’s disparate comments about ethics and moral principles cannot be reconciled.
  • Colman, John. John Locke’s Moral Philosophy. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1983.
    • In this study, Colman addresses the major themes and problems of Locke’s moral theory including the connection between law and obligation, and the connection between moral principles and    demonstrability.
  • Darwall, Stephen. The British Moralists and the Internal 'Ought': 1640–1740. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • This is a deep and broad study of moral philosophy from the mid 17th to the mid 18th century. Locke is one among several central figures under discussion. The reader greatly benefits from Darwall’s careful discussions of the theoretical connections between Locke and his contemporaries and his influences on the topics of natural law, autonomy, motivation, duty, and freedom.
  • Lolordo, Antonia. Locke’s Moral Man. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2012.
    • In this study, Lolordo draws on different parts of the Essay in order to see Locke’s theory of agency. She argues in favor of the interpretation according to which there are two senses of freedom in Locke’s view, one of which is properly used to attain the goal proper to a moral agent. Of particular interest is her discussion that links Locke’s comments about personal identity to moral agency and her claim that, for Locke, metaphysics is unnecessary for ethics.
  • Mabbot, J.D. John Locke. London: Macmillan Press, 1973.
    • This is a study of Locke’s philosophical system that focuses on knowledge acquisition, logic and language, ethics and theology, and political theory. In his discussion of ethics and theology, Mabbot traces Locke’s discussions of moral principles, their demonstrability, and their binding force through The Two Treatises of GovernmentThe Essays on the Laws of Nature, and An Essay Concerning Human Understanding.
  • Schouls, Peter A. Reasoned Freedom: John Locke and Enlightenment. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1992.
    • This is a defense of the view that Locke was a great influence on enlightenment thought, in particular in the domains of reason and freedom. Schouls also points out what he takes to be       many inconsistencies across and sometimes within Locke’s texts.
  • Yaffe, Gideon. Liberty Worth the Name: Locke on Free Agency. New Jersey: Princeton University Press, 2000.
    • This is a book-length study of Locke’s view of human freedom. The content includes careful analysis of the chapter 'Of Power' of the Essay in addition to comments about how this chapter is connected to Locke’s discussion of personal identity. Yaffe defends an interpretation according to which Locke’s view contains two definitions of freedom, only one of which is “worth the name”—the kind of freedom that allows the pursuit of true good.

c. Secondary Sources: Articles

  • Chappell, Vere. “Locke on the Intellectual Basis of Sin.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 32 (1994): 197–207.
  • Chappell, Vere. “Locke on the Liberty of the Will.” In Locke’s Philosophy: Content and Context. Edited by G.A.J. Rogers, 101–21. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1994.
  • Chappell, Vere. “Power in Locke’s Essay.” In The Cambridge Companion to Locke’s “An Essay Concerning Human Understanding.” Edited by Lex Newman, 130–56. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007.
    • In these articles, Chappell advances the interpretation that changes made in the fifth edition of the Essay indicate that Locke changed his view about human freedom.
  • Darwall, Stephen. “The Foundations of Morality,” In The Cambridge Companion to Early Modern Philosophy. Edited by Donald Rutherford, 221–49.
    • This paper canvasses the main themes explored by and influences on early modern moral theories, including Locke’s.
  • Glauser, Richard. “Thinking and Willing in Locke’s Theory of Human Freedom,” Dialogue 42 (2003): 695–724.
    • Glauser argues that Locke’s view remains consistent across the changes made in the various editions of the Essay.
  • Magri, Tito. “Locke, Suspension of Desire, and the Remote Good,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy 8 (2000): 55–70.
    • Magri argues that Locke’s view changes over the course of the different editions of the Essay, in particular that he moves from having an “internalist” view of motivation to having an “externalist” view of motivation. Magri casts doubt on the consistency of Locke’s position.
  • Mathewson, Mark D. “John Locke and the Problems of Moral Knowledge,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 87 (2006): 509–26.
    • Mathewson argues that Locke’s comments about the nature of moral ideas leads to moral subjectivity and relativism.
  • Rickless, Samuel. “Locke on Active Power, Freedom, and Moral Agency,” Locke Studies 13 (2013): 31–51.
  • Rickless, Samuel. “Locke on the Freedom to Will.”  Locke Newsletter 31 (2000): 43–68.
    • In these papers, Rickless argues that Locke holds one and only one definition of freedom: the ability to act according to our volitions. According to Rickless, Locke holds the same definition of freedom as Hobbes. The 2013 paper is a direct argument against the interpretation advanced by Lolordo in Locke’s Moral Man.
  • Schneewind, J.B. “Locke’s Moral Philosophy,” The Cambridge Companion to Locke. Edited by Vere Chappell. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
    • Schneewind is one commentator who thinks that Locke’s moral philosophy ends up in a contradiction between the natural law view and hedonism.
  • Walsh, Julie. “Locke and the Power to Suspend Desire,” Locke Studies, 14 (2014).
    • Walsh argues that Locke’s view remains consistent and coherent across the various editions of the Essay and emphasizes the role played by suspension and judgment in attaining true happiness.


Author Information

Julie Walsh
Université du Québec à Montréal

Act and Rule Utilitarianism

Utilitarianism is one of the best known and most influential moral theories. Like other forms of consequentialism, its core idea is that whether actions are morally right or wrong depends on their effects. More specifically, the only effects of actions that are relevant are the good and bad results that they produce. A key point in this article concerns the distinction between individual actions and types of actions. Act utilitarians focus on the effects of individual actions (such as John Wilkes Booth’s assassination of Abraham Lincoln) while rule utilitarians focus on the effects of types of actions (such as killing or stealing).

Utilitarians believe that the purpose of morality is to make life better by increasing the amount of good things (such as pleasure and happiness) in the world and decreasing the amount of bad things (such as pain and unhappiness). They reject moral codes or systems that consist of commands or taboos that are based on customs, traditions, or orders given by leaders or supernatural beings. Instead, utilitarians think that what makes a morality be true or justifiable is its positive contribution to human (and perhaps non-human) beings.

The most important classical utilitarians are Jeremy Bentham (1748-1832) and John Stuart Mill (1806-1873). Bentham and Mill were both important theorists and social reformers. Their theory has had a major impact both on philosophical work in moral theory and on approaches to economic, political, and social policy. Although utilitarianism has always had many critics,  there are many 21st century thinkers that support it.

The task of determining whether utilitarianism is the correct moral theory is complicated because there are different versions of the theory, and its supporters disagree about which version is correct. This article focuses on perhaps the most important dividing line among utilitarians, the clash between act utilitarianism and rule utilitarianism. After a brief overall explanation of utilitarianism, the article explains both act utilitarianism and rule utilitarianism, the main differences between them, and some of the key arguments for and against each view.

Table of Contents

  1. Utilitarianism: Overall View
    1. What is Good?
    2. Whose Well-being?
      1. Individual Self-interest
      2. Groups
      3. Everyone Affected
    3. Actual Consequences or Foreseeable Consequences?
  2. How Act Utilitarianism and Rule Utilitarianism Differ
  3. Act Utilitarianism: Pros and Cons
    1. Arguments for Act Utilitarianism
      1. Why Act utilitarianism Maximizes Utility
      2. Why Act Utilitarianism is Better than Traditional, Rule-based Moralities
      3. Why Act Utilitarianism Makes Moral Judgments Objectively True
    2. Arguments against Act Utilitarianism
      1. The “Wrong Answers” Objection
      2. The “Undermining Trust” Objection
      3. Partiality and the “Too Demanding” Objection
    3. Possible Responses to Criticisms of Act Utilitarianism
  4. Rule Utilitarianism: Pros and Cons
    1. Arguments for Rule Utilitarianism
      1. Why Rule Utilitarianism Maximizes Utility
      2. Rule Utilitarianism Avoids the Criticisms of Act Utilitarianism
        1. Judges, Doctors, and Promise-makers
        2. Maintaining vs. Undermining Trust
        3. Impartiality and the Problem of Over-Demandingness
    2. Arguments against Rule Utilitarianism
      1. The “Rule Worship” Objection
      2. The “Collapses into Act Utilitarianism” Objection
      3. Wrong Answers and Crude Concepts
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Classic Works
    2. More Recent Utilitarians
    3. Overviews
    4. J. S. Mill and Utilitarian Moral Theory
    5. Critics of Utilitarianism
    6. Collections of Essays

1. Utilitarianism: Overall View

Utilitarianism is a philosophical view or theory about how we should evaluate a wide range of things that involve choices that people face. Among the things that can be evaluated are actions, laws, policies, character traits, and moral codes. Utilitarianism is a form of consequentialism because it rests on the idea that it is the consequences or results of actions, laws, policies, etc. that determine whether they are good or bad, right or wrong. In general, whatever is being evaluated, we ought to choose the one that will produce the best overall results. In the language of utilitarians, we should choose the option that “maximizes utility,” i.e. that action or policy that produces the largest amount of good.

Utilitarianism appears to be a simple theory because it consists of only one evaluative principle: Do what produces the best consequences. In fact, however, the theory is complex because we cannot understand that single principle unless we know (at least) three things: a) what things are good and bad;  b) whose good (i.e. which individuals or groups) we should aim to maximize; and c) whether actions, policies, etc. are made right or wrong by their actual consequences (the results that our actions actually produce) or by their foreseeable consequences (the results that we predict will occur based on the evidence that we have).

a. What is Good?

Jeremy Bentham answered this question by adopting the view called hedonism. According to hedonism, the only thing that is good in itself is pleasure (or happiness). Hedonists do not deny that many different kinds of things can be good, including food, friends, freedom, and many other things, but hedonists see these as “instrumental” goods that are valuable only because they play a causal role in producing pleasure or happiness. Pleasure and happiness, however, are “intrinsic” goods, meaning that they are good in themselves and not because they produce some further valuable thing. Likewise, on the negative side, a lack of food, friends, or freedom is instrumentally bad because it produces pain, suffering, and unhappiness; but pain, suffering and unhappiness are intrinsically bad, i.e. bad in themselves and not because they produce some further bad thing.

Many thinkers have rejected hedonism because pleasure and pain are sensations that we feel, claiming that many important goods are not types of feelings. Being healthy or honest or having knowledge, for example, are thought by some people to be intrinsic goods that are not types of feelings. (People who think there are many such goods are called pluralists or“objective list” theorists.) Other thinkers see desires or preferences as the basis of value; whatever a person desires is valuable to that person. If desires conflict, then the things most strongly preferred are identified as good.

In this article, the term “well-being” will generally be used to identify what utilitarians see as good or valuable in itself. All utilitarians agree that things are valuable because they tend to produce well-being or diminish ill-being, but this idea is understood differently by hedonists, objective list theorists, and preference/desire theorists. This debate will not be further discussed in this article.

b. Whose Well-being?

Utilitarian reasoning can be used for many different purposes. It can be used both for moral reasoning and for any type of rational decision-making. In addition to applying in different contexts, it can also be used for deliberations about the interests of different persons and groups.

i. Individual Self-interest

(See egoism.) When individuals are deciding what to do for themselves alone, they consider only their own utility. For example, if you are choosing ice cream for yourself, the utilitarian view is that you should choose the flavor that will give you the most pleasure. If you enjoy chocolate but hate vanilla, you should choose chocolate for the pleasure it will bring and avoid vanilla because it will bring displeasure. In addition, if you enjoy both chocolate and strawberry, you should predict which flavor will bring you more pleasure and choose whichever one will do that.

In this case, because utilitarian reasoning is being applied to a decision about which action is best for an individual person, it focuses only on how the various possible choices will affect this single person’s interest and does not consider the interests of other people.

ii. Groups

People often need to judge what is best not only for themselves or other individuals but alsowhat is best for groups, such as friends, families, religious groups, one’s country, etc. Because Bentham and other utilitarians were interested in political groups and public policies, they often focused on discovering which actions and policies would maximize the well-being of the relevant group. Their method for determining the well-being of a group involved adding up the benefits and losses that members of the group would experience as a result of adopting one action or policy. The well-being of the group is simply the sum total of the interests of the all of its members.

To illustrate this method, suppose that you are buying ice cream for a party that ten people will attend. Your only flavor options are chocolate and vanilla, and some of the people attending like chocolate while others like vanilla. As a utilitarian, you should choose the flavor that will result in the most pleasure for the group as a whole. If seven like chocolate and three like vanilla and if all of them get the same amount of pleasure from the flavor they like, then you should choose chocolate. This will yield what Bentham, in a famous phrase, called “the greatest happiness for the greatest number.”

An important point in this case is that you should choose chocolate even if you are one of the three people who enjoy vanilla more than chocolate. The utilitarian method requires you to count everyone’s interests equally. You may not weigh some people’s interests—including your own—more heavily than others. Similarly, if a government is choosing a policy, it should give equal consideration to the well-being of all members of the society.

iii. Everyone Affected

While there are circumstances in which the utilitarian analysis focuses on the interests of specific individuals or groups, the utilitarian moral theory requires that moral judgments be based on what Peter Singer calls the “equal consideration of interests.” Utilitarianism moral theory then, includes the important idea that when we calculate the utility of actions, laws, or policies, we must do so from an impartial perspective and not from a “partialist” perspective that favors ourselves, our friends, or others we especially care about. Bentham is often cited as the source of a famous utilitarian axiom: “every man to count for one, nobody for more than one.”

If this impartial perspective is seen as necessary for a utilitarian morality, then both self-interest and partiality to specific groups will be rejected as deviations from utilitarian morality. For example, so-called “ethical egoism,” which says that morality requires people to promote their own interest, would be rejected either as a false morality or as not a morality at all. While a utilitarian method for determining what people’s interests are may show that it is rational for people to maximize their own well-being or the well-being of groups that they favor, utilitarian morality would reject this as a criterion for determining what is morally right or wrong.

c. Actual Consequences or Foreseeable Consequences?

Utilitarians disagree about whether judgments of right and wrong should be based on the actual consequences of actions or their foreseeable consequences. This issue arises when the actual effects of actions differ from what we expected. J. J. C. Smart (49) explains this difference by imagining the action of a person who, in 1938,saves someone from drowning. While we generally regard saving a drowning person as the right thing to do and praise people for such actions, in Smart’s imagined example, the person saved from drowning turns out to be Adolph Hitler. Had Hitler drowned, millions of other people might have been saved from suffering and death between 1938 and 1945. If utilitarianism evaluates the rescuer’s action based on its actual consequences, then the rescuer did the wrong thing. If, however, utilitarians judge the rescuer’s action by its foreseeable consequences (i.e. the ones the rescuer could reasonably predict), then the rescuer—who could not predict the negative effects of saving the person from drowning—did the right thing.

One reason for adopting foreseeable consequence utilitarianism is that it seems unfair to say that the rescuer acted wrongly because the rescuer could not foresee the future bad effects of saving the drowning person. In response, actual consequence utilitarians reply that there is a difference between evaluating an action and evaluating the person who did the action. In their view, while the rescuer’s action was wrong, it would be a mistake to blame or criticize the rescuer because the bad results of his act were unforeseeable. They stress the difference between evaluating actions and evaluating the people who perform them.

Foreseeable consequence utilitarians accept the distinction between evaluating actions and evaluating the people who carry them out, but they see no reason to make the moral rightness or wrongness of actions depend on facts that might be unknowable. For them, what is right or wrong for a person to do depends on what is knowable by a person at a time. For this reason, they claim that the person who rescued Hitler did the right thing, even though the actual consequences were unfortunate.

Another way to describe the actual vs. foreseeable consequence dispute is to contrast two thoughts. One (the actual consequence view) says that to act rightly is to do whatever produces the best consequences. The second view says that a person acts rightly by doing the action that has the highest level of “expected utility.” The expected utility is a combination of the good (or bad) effects that one predicts will result from an action and the probability of those effects occurring. In the case of the rescuer, the expected positive utility is high because the probability that saving a drowning person will lead to the deaths of millions of other people is extremely low, and thus can be ignored in deliberations about whether to save the drowning person.

What this shows is that actual consequence and foreseeable consequence utilitarians have different views about the nature of utilitarian theory. Foreseeable consequence utilitarians understand the theory as a decision-making procedure while actual consequence utilitarians understand it as a criterion of right and wrong. Foreseeable consequence utilitarians claim that the action with the highest expected utility is both the best thing to do based on current evidence and the right action. Actual consequence utilitarians might agree that the option with the highest expected utility is the best thing to do but they claim that it could still turn out to be the wrong action. This would occur if unforeseen bad consequences reveal that the option chosen did not have the best results and thus was the wrong thing to do.

2. How Act Utilitarianism and Rule Utilitarianism Differ

Both act utilitarians and rule utilitarians agree that our overall aim in evaluating actions should be to create the best results possible, but they differ about how to do that.

Act utilitarians believe that whenever we are deciding what to do, we should perform the action that will create the greatest net utility. In their view, the principle of utility—do whatever will produce the best overall results—should be applied on a case by case basis. The right action in any situation is the one that yields more utility (i.e. creates more well-being) than other available actions.

Rule utilitarians adopt a two part view that stresses the importance of moral rules. According to rule utilitarians, a) a specific action is morally justified if it conforms to a justified moral rule; and b) a moral rule is justified if its inclusion into our moral code would create more utility than other possible rules (or no rule at all). According to this perspective, we should judge the morality of individual actions by reference to general moral rules, and we should judge particular moral rules by seeing whether their acceptance into our moral code would produce more well-being than other possible rules.

The key difference between act and rule utilitarianism is that act utilitarians apply the utilitarian principle directly to the evaluation of individual actions while rule utilitarians apply the utilitarian principle directly to the evaluation of rules and then evaluate individual actions by seeing if they obey or disobey those rules whose acceptance will produce the most utility.

The contrast between act and rule utilitarianism, though previously noted by some philosophers, was not sharply drawn until the late 1950s when Richard Brandt introduced this terminology. (Other terms that have been used to make this contrast are “direct” and “extreme” for act utilitarianism, and “indirect” and “restricted” for rule utilitarianism.) Because the contrast had not been sharply drawn, earlier utilitarians like Bentham and Mill sometimes apply the principle of utility to actions and sometimes apply it to the choice of rules for evaluating actions. This has led to scholarly debates about whether the classical utilitarians supported act utilitarians or rule utilitarians or some combination of these views. One indication that Mill accepted rule utilitarianism is his claim that direct appeal to the principle of utility is made only when “secondary principles” (i.e. rules) conflict with one another. In such cases, the “maximize utility” principle is used to resolve the conflict and determine the right action to take. [Mill, Utilitarianism, Chapter 2]

3. Act Utilitarianism: Pros and Cons

Act utilitarianism is often seen as the most natural interpretation of the utilitarian ideal. If our aim is always to produce the best results, it seems plausible to think that in each case of deciding what is the right thing to do, we should consider the available options (i.e. what actions could be performed), predict their outcomes, and approve of the action that will produce the most good.

a. Arguments for Act Utilitarianism

i. Why Act utilitarianism Maximizes Utility

If every action that we carry out yields more utility than any other action available to us, then the total utility of all our actions will be the highest possible level of utility that we could bring about. In other words, we can maximize the overall utility that is within our power to bring about by maximizing the utility of each individual action that we perform. If we sometimes choose actions that produce less utility than is possible, the total utility of our actions will be less than the amount of goodness that we could have produced. For that reason, act utilitarians argue, we should apply the utilitarian principle to individual acts and not to classes of similar actions.

ii. Why Act Utilitarianism is Better than Traditional, Rule-based Moralities

Traditional moral codes often consist of sets of rules regarding types of actions. The Ten Commandments, for example, focus on types of actions, telling us not to kill, steal, bear false witness, commit adultery, or covet the things that belong to others. Although the Biblical sources permit exceptions to these rules (such as killing in self-defense and punishing people for their sins), the form of the commandments is absolute. They tell us “thou shalt not do x” rather than saying “thou shalt not do x except in circumstances a, b, or c.”

In fact, both customary and philosophical moral codes often seem to consist of absolute rules. The philosopher Immanuel Kant is famous for the view that lying is always wrong, even in cases where one might save a life by lying. According to Kant, if A is trying to murder B and A asks you where B is, it would be wrong for you to lie to A, even if lying would save B’s life (Kant).

Act utilitarians reject rigid rule-based moralities that identify whole classes of actions as right or wrong. They argue that it is a mistake to treat whole classes of actions as right or wrong because the effects of actions differ when they are done in different contexts and morality must focus on the likely effects of individual actions. It is these effects that determine whether they are right or wrong in specific cases. Act utilitarians acknowledge that it may be useful to have moral rules that are “rules of thumb”—i.e., rules that describe what is generally right or wrong, but they insist that whenever people can do more good by violating a rule rather than obeying it, they should violate the rule. They see no reason to obey a rule when more well-being can be achieved by violating it.

iii. Why Act Utilitarianism Makes Moral Judgments Objectively True

One advantage of act utilitarianism is that it shows how moral questions can have objectively true answers. Often, people believe that morality is subjective and depends only on people’s desires or sincere beliefs. Act utilitarianism, however, provides a method for showing which moral beliefs are true and which are false.

Once we embrace the act utilitarian perspective, then every decision about how we should act will depend on the actual or foreseeable consequences of the available options. If we can predict the amount of utility/good results that will be produced by various possible actions, then we can know which ones are right or wrong.

Although some people doubt that we can measure amounts of well-being, we in fact do this all the time. If two people are suffering and we have enough medication for only one, we can often tell that one person is experiencing mild discomfort while the other is in severe pain. Based on this judgment, we will be confident that we can do more good by giving the medication to the person suffering extreme pain. Although this case is very simple, it shows that we can have objectively true answers to questions about what actions are morally right or wrong.

Jeremy Bentham provided a model for this type of decision making in his description of a “hedonic calculus,” which was meant to show what factors should be used to determine amounts of pleasure and happiness, pain and suffering. Using this information, Bentham thought, would allow for making correct judgments both in individual cases and in choices about government actions and policies.

b. Arguments against Act Utilitarianism

i. The “Wrong Answers” Objection

The most common argument against act utilitarianism is that it gives the wrong answers to moral questions. Critics say that it permits various actions that everyone knows are morally wrong. The following cases are among the commonly cited examples:

  • If a judge can prevent riots that will cause many deaths only by convicting an innocent person of a crime and imposing a severe punishment on that person, act utilitarianism implies that the judge should convict and punish the innocent person. (See Rawls and also Punishment.)
  • If a doctor can save five people from death by killing one healthy person and using that person’s organs for life-saving transplants, then act utilitarianism implies that the doctor should kill the one person to save five.
  • If a person makes a promise but breaking the promise will allow that person to perform an action that creates just slightly more well-being than keeping the promise will, then act utilitarianism implies that the promise should be broken. (See Ross)

The general form of each of these arguments is the same. In each case, act utilitarianism implies that a certain act is morally permissible or required. Yet, each of the judgments that flow from act utilitarianism conflicts with widespread, deeply held moral beliefs. Because act utilitarianism approves of actions that most people see as obviously morally wrong, we can know that it is a false moral theory.

ii. The “Undermining Trust” Objection

Although act utilitarians criticize traditional moral rules for being too rigid, critics charge that utilitarians ignore the fact that this alleged rigidity is the basis for trust between people. If, in cases like the ones described above, judges, doctors, and promise-makers are committed to doing whatever maximizes well-being, then no one will be able to trust that judges will act according to the law, that doctors will not use the organs of one patient to benefit others, and that promise-makers will keep their promises. More generally, if everyone believed that morality permitted lying, promise-breaking, cheating, and violating the law whenever doing so led to good results, then no one could trust other people to obey these rules. As a result, in an act utilitarian society, we could not believe what others say, could not rely on them to keep promises, and in general could not count on people to act in accord with important moral rules. As a result, people’s behavior would lack the kind of predictability and consistency that are required to sustain trust and social stability.

iii. Partiality and the “Too Demanding” Objection

Critics also attack utilitarianism’s commitment to impartiality and the equal consideration of interests. An implication of this commitment is that whenever people want to buy something for themselves or for a friend or family member, they must first determine whether they could create more well-being by donating their money to help unknown strangers who are seriously ill or impoverished. If more good can be done by helping strangers than by purchasing things for oneself or people one personally cares about, then act utilitarianism requires us to use the money to help strangers in need. Why? Because act utilitarianism requires impartiality and the equal consideration of all people’s needs and interests.

Almost everyone, however, believes that we have special moral duties to people who are near and dear to us. As a result, most people would reject the notion that morality requires us to treat people we love and care about no differently from people who are perfect strangers as absurd.

This issue is not merely a hypothetical case. In a famous article, Peter Singer defends the view that people living in affluent countries should not purchase luxury items for themselves when the world is full of impoverished people. According to Singer, a person should keep donating money to people in dire need until the donor reaches the point where giving to others generates more harm to the donor than the good that is generated for the recipients.

Critics claim that the argument for using our money to help impoverished strangers rather than benefiting ourselves and people we care about only proves one thing—that act utilitarianism is false. There are two reasons that show why it is false. First, it fails to recognize the moral legitimacy of giving special preferences to ourselves and people that we know and care about. Second, since pretty much everyone is strongly motivated to act on behalf of themselves and people they care about, a morality that forbids this and requires equal consideration of strangers is much too demanding. It asks more than can reasonably be expected of people.

c. Possible Responses to Criticisms of Act Utilitarianism

There are two ways in which act utilitarians can defend their view against these criticisms. First, they can argue that critics misinterpret act utilitarianism and mistakenly claim that it is committed to supporting the wrong answer to various moral questions. This reply agrees that the “wrong answers” are genuinely wrong, but it denies that the “wrong answers” maximize utility. Because they do not maximize utility, these wrong answers would not be supported by act utilitarians and therefore, do nothing to weaken their theory.

Second, act utilitarians can take a different approach by agreeing with the critics that act utilitarianism supports the views that critics label “wrong answers.”  Act utilitarians may reply that all this shows is that the views supported by act utilitarianism conflict with common sense morality. Unless critics can prove that common sense moral beliefs are correct the criticisms have no force. Act utilitarians claim that their theory provides good reasons to reject many ordinary moral claims and to replace them with moral views that are based on the effects of actions.

People who are convinced by the criticisms of act utilitarianism may decide to reject utilitarianism entirely and adopt a different type of moral theory. This judgment, however, would be sound only if act utilitarianism were the only type of utilitarian theory. If there are other versions of utilitarianism that do not have act utilitarianism’s flaws, then one may accept the criticisms of act utilitarianism without forsaking utilitarianism entirely. This is what defenders of rule utilitarianism claim. They argue that rule utilitarianism retains the virtues of a utilitarian moral theory but without the flaws of the act utilitarian version.

4. Rule Utilitarianism: Pros and Cons

Unlike act utilitarians, who try to maximize overall utility by applying the utilitarian principle to individual acts, rule utilitarians believe that we can maximize utility only by setting up a moral code that contains rules. The correct moral rules are those whose inclusion in our moral code will produce better results (more well-being) than other possible rules. Once we determine what these rules are, we can then judge individual actions by seeing if they conform to these rules. The principle of utility, then, is used to evaluate rules and is not applied directly to individual actions. Once the rules are determined, compliance with these rules provides the standard for evaluating individual actions.

a. Arguments for Rule Utilitarianism

i. Why Rule Utilitarianism Maximizes Utility

Rule utilitarianism sounds paradoxical. It says that we can produce more beneficial results by following rules than by always performing individual actions whose results are as beneficial as possible. This suggests that we should not always perform individual actions that maximize utility. How could this be something that a utilitarian would support?

In spite of this paradox, rule utilitarianism possesses its own appeal, and its focus on moral rules can sound quite plausible. The rule utilitarian approach to morality can be illustrated by considering the rules of the road. If we are devising a code for drivers, we can adopt either open-ended rules like “drive safely” or specific rules like “stop at red lights,” "do not travel more than 30 miles per hour in residential areas,” “do not drive when drunk," etc. The rule “drive safely”, like the act utilitarian principle, is a very general rule that leaves it up to individuals to determine what the best way to drive in each circumstance is.  More specific rules that require stopping at lights, forbid going faster than 30 miles per hour, or prohibit driving while drunk do not give drivers the discretion to judge what is best to do. They simply tell drivers what to do or not do while driving.

The reason why a more rigid rule-based system leads to greater overall utility is that people are notoriously bad at judging what is the best thing to do when they are driving a car. Having specific rules maximizes utility by limiting drivers’ discretionary judgments and thereby decreasing the ways in which drivers may endanger themselves and others.

A rule utilitarian can illustrate this by considering the difference between stop signs and yield signs. Stop signs forbid drivers to go through an intersection without stopping, even if the driver sees that there are no cars approaching and thus no danger in not stopping. A yield sign permits drivers to go through without stopping unless they judge that approaching cars make it dangerous to drive through the intersection. The key difference between these signs is the amount of discretion that they give to the driver.

The stop sign is like the rule utilitarian approach. It tells drivers to stop and does not allow them to calculate whether it would be better to stop or not. The yield sign is like act utilitarianism. It permits drivers to decide whether there is a need to stop. Act utilitarians see the stop sign as too rigid because it requires drivers to stop even when nothing bad will be prevented. The result, they say, is a loss of utility each time a driver stops at a stop sign when there is no danger from oncoming cars.

Rule utilitarians will reply that they would reject the stop sign method a) if people could be counted on to drive carefully and b) if traffic accidents only caused limited amounts of harm. But, they say, neither of these is true. Because people often drive too fast and are inattentive while driving (because they are, for example, talking, texting, listening to music, or tired), we cannot count on people to make good utilitarian judgments about how to drive safely. In addition, the costs (i.e. the disutility) of accidents can be very high. Accident victims (including drivers) may be killed, injured, or disabled for life. For these reasons, rule utilitarians support the use of stop signs and other non-discretionary rules under some circumstances. Overall these rules generate greater utility because they prevent more disutility (from accidents) than they create (from “unnecessary” stops).

Rule utilitarians generalize from this type of case and claim that our knowledge of human behavior shows that there are many cases in which general rules or practices are more likely to promote good effects than simply telling people to do whatever they think is best in each individual case.

This does not mean that rule utilitarians always support rigid rules without exceptions. Some rules can identify types of situations in which the prohibition is over-ridden. In emergency medical situations, for example, a driver may justifiably go through a red light or stop sign based on the driver’s own assessment that a) this can be done safely and b) the situation is one in which even a short delay might cause dire harms. So the correct rule need not be “never go through a stop sign” but rather can be something like “never go through a stop sign except in cases that have properties a and b.” In addition, there will remain many things about driving or other behavior that can be left to people’s discretion. The rules of the road do not tell drivers when to drive or what their destination should be for example.

Overall then, rule utilitarian can allow departures from rules and will leave many choices up to individuals. In such cases, people may act in the manner that looks like the approach supported by act utilitarians. Nonetheless, these discretionary actions are permitted because having a rule in these cases does not maximize utility or because the best rule may impose some constraints on how people act while still permitting a lot of discretion in deciding what to do.

ii. Rule Utilitarianism Avoids the Criticisms of Act Utilitarianism

As discussed earlier, critics of act utilitarianism raise three strong objections against it. According to these critics, act utilitarianism a) approves of actions that are clearly wrong; b) undermines trust among people, and c) is too demanding because it requires people to make excessive levels of sacrifice. Rule utilitarians tend to agree with these criticisms of act utilitarianism and try to explain why rule utilitarianism is not open to any of these objections.

1. Judges, Doctors, and Promise-makers

Critics of act utilitarianism claim that it allows judges to sentence innocent people to severe punishments when doing so will maximize utility, allows doctors to kill healthy patients if by doing so, they can use the organs of one person to save more lives, and allows people to break promises if that will create slightly more benefits than keeping the promise.

Rule utilitarians say that they can avoid all these charges because they do not evaluate individual actions separately but instead support rules whose acceptance maximizes utility. To see the difference that their focus on rules makes, consider which rule would maximize utility: a) a rule that allows medical doctors to kill healthy patients so that they can use their organs for transplants that will save a larger number of patients who would die without these organs; or b) a rule that forbids doctors to remove the organs of healthy patients in order to benefit other patients.

Although more good may be done by killing the healthy patient in an individual case, it is unlikely that more overall good will be done by having a rule that allows this practice. If a rule were adopted that allows doctors to kill healthy patients when this will save more lives, the result would be that many people would not go to doctors at all. A rule utilitarian evaluation will take account of the fact that the benefits of medical treatment would be greatly diminished because people would no longer trust doctors. People who seek medical treatment must have a high degree of trust in doctors. If they had to worry that doctors might use their organs to help other patients, they would not, for example, allow doctors to anesthetize them for surgery because the resulting loss of consciousness would make them completely vulnerable and unable to defend themselves. Thus, the rule that allows doctors to kill one patient to save five would not maximize utility.

The same reasoning applies equally to the case of the judge. In order to have a criminal justice system that protects people from being harmed by others, we authorize judges and other officials to impose serious punishments on people who are convicted of crimes. The purpose of this is to provide overall security to people in their jurisdiction, but this requires that criminal justice officials only have the authority to impose arrest and imprisonment on people who are actually believed to be guilty. They do not have the authority to do whatever they think will lead to the best results in particular cases. Whatever they do must be constrained by rules that limit their power. Act utilitarians may sometimes support the intentional punishment of innocent people, but rule utilitarians will understand the risks involved and will oppose a practice that allows it.

Rule utilitarians offer a similar analysis of the promise keeping case. They explain that in general, we want people to keep their promises even in some cases in which doing so may lead to less utility than breaking the promise. The reason for this is that the practice of promise-keeping is a very valuable. It enables people to have a wide range of cooperative relationships by generating confidence that other people will do what they promise to do. If we knew that people would fail to keep promises whenever some option arises that leads to more utility, then we could not trust people who make promises to us to carry them through. We would always have to worry that some better option (one that act utilitarians would favor) might emerge, leading to the breaking of the person’s promise to us.

In each of these cases then, rule utilitarians can agree with the critics of act utilitarianism that it is wrong for doctors, judges, and promise-makers to do case by case evaluations of whether they should harm their patients, convict and punish innocent people, and break promises. The rule utilitarian approach stresses the value of general rules and practices, and shows why compliance with rules often maximizes overall utility even if in some individual cases, it requires doing what produces less utility.

2. Maintaining vs. Undermining Trust

Rule utilitarians see the social impact of a rule-based morality as one of the key virtues of their theory. The three cases just discussed show why act utilitarianism undermines trust but rule utilitarianism does not. Fundamentally, in the cases of doctors, judges, and promise-keepers, it is trust that is at stake. Being able to trust other people is extremely important to our well-being. Part of trusting people involves being able to predict what they will and won’t do. Because act utilitarians are committed to a case by case evaluation method, the adoption of their view would make people’s actions much less predictable. As a result, people would be less likely to see other people as reliable and trustworthy. Rule utilitarianism does not have this problem because it is committed to rules, and these rules generate positive “expectation effects” that give us a basis for knowing how other people are likely to behave.

While rule utilitarians do not deny that there are people who are not trustworthy, they can claim that their moral code generally condemns violations of trust as wrongful acts. The problem with act utilitarians is that they support a moral view that has the effect of undermining trust and that sacrifices the good effects of a moral code that supports and encourages trustworthiness.

3. Impartiality and the Problem of Over-Demandingness

Rule utilitarians believe that their view is also immune to the criticism that act utilitarianism is too demanding. In addition, while the act utilitarian commitment to impartiality undermines the moral relevance of personal relations, rule utilitarians claim that their view is not open to this criticism. They claim that rule utilitarianism allows for partiality toward ourselves and others with whom we share personal relationships. Moreover, they say, rule utilitarianism can recognize justifiable partiality to some people without rejecting the commitment to impartiality that is central to the utilitarian tradition.

How can rule utilitarianism do this? How can it be an impartial moral theory while also allowing partiality in people’s treatment of their friends, family, and others with whom they have a special connection?

In his defense of rule utilitarianism, Brad Hooker distinguishes two different contexts in which partiality and impartiality play a role. One involves the justification of moral rules and the other concerns the application of moral rules. Justifications of moral rules, he claims, must be strictly impartial. When we ask whether a rule should be adopted, it is essential to consider the impact of the rule on all people and to weigh the interests of everyone equally.

The second context concerns the content of the rules and how they are applied in actual cases. Rule utilitarians argue that a rule utilitarian moral code will allow partiality to play a role in determining what morality requires, forbids, or allows us to do. As an example, consider a moral rule parents have a special duty to care for their own children. (See Parental Rights and Obligations.) This is a partialist rule because it not only allows but actually requires parents to devote more time, energy, and other resources to their own children than to others. While it does not forbid devoting resources to other people’s children, it allows people to give to their own. While the content of this rule is not impartial, rule utilitarians believe it can be impartially justified. Partiality toward children can be justified for several reasons. Caring for children is a demanding activity. Children need the special attention of adults to develop physically, emotionally, and cognitively. Because children’s needs vary, knowledge of particular children’s needs is necessary to benefit them. For these reasons, it is plausible to believe that children’s well-being can best be promoted by a division of labor that requires particular parents (or other caretakers) to focus primarily on caring for specific children rather than trying to take care of all children. It is not possible for absentee parents or strangers to provide individual children with all that they need. Therefore, we can maximize the overall well-being of children as a class by designating certain people as the caretakers for specific children. For these reasons, partiality toward specific children can be impartially justified.

Similar “division of labor” arguments can be used to provide impartial justifications of other partialist rules and practices. Teachers, for example have special duties to students in their own classes and have no duty to educate all students. Similarly, public officials can and should be partial to people in the jurisdiction in which they work. If the overall aim is to maximize the well-being of all people in all cities, for example, then we are likely to get better results by having individuals who know and understand particular cities focus on them while other people focus on other cities.

Based on examples like these, rule utilitarians claim that their view, unlike act utilitarianism, avoids the problems raised about demandingness and partiality. Being committed to impartialist justifications of moral rules does not commit them to rejecting moral rules that allow or require people to give specific others priority.

While rule utilitarians can defend partiality, their commitment to maximizing overall utility also allows them to justify limits on the degree of partiality that is morally permissible. At a minimum, rule utilitarians will support a rule that forbids parents to harm other people’s children in order to advance the interests of their own children. (It would be wrong, for example, for a parent to injure children who are running in a school race in order to increase the chances that their own children will win.) Moreover, though this is more controversial, rule utilitarians may support a rule that says that if parents are financially well-off and if their own children’s needs are fully met, these parents may have a moral duty to contribute some resources for children who are deprived of essential resources.

The key point is that while rule utilitarianism permits partiality toward some people, it can also generate rules that limit the ways in which people may act partially and it might even support a positive duty for well off people to provide assistance to strangers when the needs and interests of people to whom we are partial are fully met, when they have surplus resources that could be used to assist strangers in dire conditions, and when there are ways to channel these resources effectively to people in dire need.

b. Arguments against Rule Utilitarianism

i. The “Rule Worship” Objection

Act utilitarians criticize rule utilitarians for irrationally supporting rule-based actions in cases where more good could be done by violating the rule than obeying it. They see this as a form of “rule worship,” an irrational deference to rules that has no utilitarian justification (J. J. C. Smart).

Act utilitarians say that they recognize that rules can have value. For example, rules can provide a basis for acting when there is no time to deliberate. In addition, rules can define a default position, a justification for doing (or refraining from) a type of action as long as there is no reason for not doing it. But when people know that more good can be done by violating the rule then the default position should be over-ridden.

ii. The “Collapses into Act Utilitarianism” Objection

While the “rule worship” objection assumes that rule utilitarianism is different from act utilitarianism, some critics deny that this is the case. In their view, whatever defects act utilitarianism may have, rule utilitarianism will have the same defects. According to this criticism, although rule utilitarianism looks different from act utilitarianism, a careful examination shows that it collapses into or, as David Lyons claimed, is extensionally equivalent to act utilitarianism.

To understand this criticism, it is worth focusing on a distinction between rule utilitarianism and other non-utilitarian theories. Consider Kant’s claim that lying is always morally wrong, even when lying would save a person’s life. Many people see this view as too rigid and claim that it fails to take into account the circumstances in which a lie is being told. A more plausible rule would say “do not lie except in special circumstances that justify lying.” But what are these special circumstances? For a utilitarian, it is natural to say that the correct rule is “do not lie except when lying will generate more good than telling the truth.”

Suppose that a rule utilitarian adopts this approach and advocates a moral code that consists of a list of rules of this form. The rules would say something like “do x except when not doing x maximizes utility” and “do not do x except when doing x maximizes utility.” While this may sound plausible, it is easy to see that this version of rule utilitarianism is in fact identical with act utilitarianism. Whatever action x is, the moral requirement and the moral prohibition expressed in these rules collapses into the act utilitarian rules “do x only when not doing x maximizes utility” or “do not do x except when doing x maximizes utility.” These rules say exactly the same thing as the open-ended act utilitarian rule “Do whatever action maximizes utility.”

If rule utilitarianism is to be distinct from act utilitarianism, its supporters must find a way to formulate rules that allow exceptions to a general requirement or prohibition while not collapsing into act utilitarianism. One way to do this is to identify specific conditions under which violating a general moral requirement would be justified. Instead of saying that we can violate a general rule whenever doing so will maximize utility, the rule utilitarian code might say things like “Do not lie except to prevent severe harms to people who are not unjustifiably threatening others with severe harm.” This type of rule would prohibit lying generally, but it would permit lying to a murderer to prevent harm to the intended victims even if the lie would lead to harm to the murderer. In cases of lesser harms or deceitful acts that will benefit the liar, lying would still be prohibited, even if lying might maximize overall utility.

Rule utilitarians claim that this sort of rule is not open to the “collapses into act utilitarianism” objection. It also suggests, however, that rule utilitarians face difficult challenges in formulating utility-based rules that have a reasonable degree of flexibility built into them but are not so flexible that they collapse into act utilitarianism. In addition, although the rules that make up a moral code should be flexible enough to account for the complexities of life, they cannot be so complex that they are too difficult for people to learn and understand.

iii. Wrong Answers and Crude Concepts

Although rule utilitarians try to avoid the weaknesses attributed to act utilitarianism, critics argue that they cannot avoid these weaknesses because they do not take seriously many of our central moral concepts. As a result, they cannot support the right answers to crucial moral problems. Three prominent concepts in moral thought that critics cite are justice, rights, and desert. These moral ideas are often invoked in reasoning about morality, but critics claim that neither rule nor act utilitarianism acknowledge their importance. Instead, they focus only on the amounts of utility that actions or rules generate.

In considering the case, for example, of punishing innocent people, the best that rule utilitarians can do is to say that a rule that permits this would lead to worse results overall than a rule that permitted it. This prediction, however, is precarious. While it may be true, it may also be false, and if it is false, then utilitarians must acknowledge that intentionally punishing an innocent person could sometimes be morally justified.

Against this, critics may appeal to common sense morality to support the view that there are no circumstances in which punishing the innocent can be justified because the innocent person is a) being treated unjustly, b) has a right not to be punished for something that he or she is not guilty of, and c) does not deserve to be punished for a crime that he or she did not commit.

In responding, rule utilitarians may begin, first, with the view that they do not reject concepts like justice, rights, and desert. Instead, they accept and use these concepts but interpret them from the perspective of maximizing utility. To speak of justice, rights, and desert is to speak of rules of individual treatment that are very important, and what makes them important is their contribution to promoting overall well-being. Moreover, even people who accept these concepts as basic still need to determine whether it is always wrong to treat someone unjustly, violate their rights, or treat them in ways that they don’t deserve.

Critics object to utilitarianism by claiming that the theory justifies treating people unjustly, violating their rights, etc. This criticism only stands up if it is always wrong and thus never morally justified to treat people in these ways.  Utilitarians  argue that moral common sense is less absolutist than their critics acknowledge. In the case of punishment, for example, while we hope that our system of criminal justice gives people fair trials and conscientiously attempts to separate the innocent from the guilty, we know that the system is not perfect. As a result, people who are innocent are sometimes prosecuted, convicted, and punished for crimes they did not do.

This is the problem of wrongful convictions, which poses a difficult challenge to critics of utilitarianism. If we know that our system of criminal justice punishes some people unjustly and in ways they don’t deserve, we are faced with a dilemma. Either we can shut down the system and punish no one, or we can maintain the system even though we know that it will result in some innocent people being unjustly punished in ways that they do not deserve. Most people will support continuing to punish people in spite of the fact that it involves punishing some people unjustly. According to rule utilitarians, this can only be justified if a rule that permits punishments (after a fair trial, etc.) yields more overall utility than a rule that rejects punishment because it treats some people unfairly. To end the practice of punishment entirely—because it inevitably causes some injustice—is likely to result in worse consequences because it deprives society of a central means of protecting people’s well-being, including what are regarded as their rights. In the end, utilitarians say, it is justice and rights that give way when rules that approve of violations in some cases yield the greatest amount of utility.

5. Conclusion

The debate between act utilitarianism and rule utilitarianism highlights many important issues about how we should make moral judgments. Act utilitarianism stresses the specific context and the many individual features of the situations that pose moral problems, and it presents a single method for dealing with these individual cases. Rule utilitarianism stresses the recurrent features of human life and the ways in which similar needs and problems arise over and over again. From this perspective, we need rules that deal with types or classes of actions: killing, stealing, lying, cheating, taking care of our friends or family, punishing people for crimes, aiding people in need, etc. Both of these perspectives, however, agree that the main determinant of what is right or wrong is the relationship between what we do or what form our moral code takes and what is the impact of our moral perspective on the level of people’s well-being.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Classic Works

  • Jeremy Bentham.  An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, available in many editions, 1789.
    • See Book I, chapter 1 for Bentham’s statement of what utilitarianism is; chapter IV for his method of measuring amounts of pleasure/utility; chapter V for his list of types of pleasures and pains, and chapter XIII for his application of utilitarianism to questions about criminal punishment.
  • John Stuart Mill. Utilitarianism, available in many editions and online, 1861.
    • See especially chapter II, in which Mill tries both to clarify and defend utilitarianism. Passages at the end of chapter suggest that Mill was a rule utilitarian. In chapter V, Mill tries to show that utilitarianism is compatible with justice.
  • Henry Sidgwick. The Methods of Ethics, Seventh Edition, available in many editions, 1907.
    • Sidgwick is known for his careful, extended analysis of utilitarian moral theory and competing views.
  • G. E. Moore. Principia Ethica, 1903.
    • Moore criticizes aspects of Mill’s views but support a non-hedonistic form of utilitarianism.
  • G. E. Moore. Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1912.
    • Mostly focused on utilitarianism, this book contains a combination of act and rule utilitarian ideas.

b. More Recent Utilitarians

  • J. J. C. Smart. “An Outline of a System of Utilitarian Ethics” in J. J. C. Smart and Bernard Williams, Utilitarianism: For and Against. Cambridge University Press, 1973.
    • Smart’s discussion combines an overview of moral theory and a defense of act utilitarianism. It is followed by Bernard Williams’, “A Critique of Utilitarianism,” a source of many important criticisms of utilitarianism.
  • Richard Brandt. Ethical Theory. Prentice Hall, 1959. Chapter 15.
    • Brandt, who coined the terms “act” and “rule” utilitarianism, explains and criticizes act utilitarianism and tentatively proposes a version of rule utilitarianism.
  • Richard Brandt. Morality, Utilitarianism, and Rights. Cambridge University Press, 1992.
    • Brandt developed and defended rule utilitarianism in many papers. This book contains several of them as well as works in which he applies rule utilitarian thinking to issues like rights and the ethics of war.
  • R. M. Hare. Moral Thinking. Oxford University Press, 1981.
    • An interesting development of a form of rule utilitarianism by an influential moral theorist.
  • John C. Harsanyi. “Morality and the Theory of Rational Behavior.” in Social Research 44.4 (1977): 623-656. (Reprinted in Amartya Sen and Bernard Williams, eds., Utilitarianism and Beyond, Cambridge University Press, 1982).
    • Harsanyi, a Nobel Prize economist, defends rule utilitarianism, connecting it to a preference theory of value and a theory of rational action.
  • John Rawls. “Two Concepts of Rules.” In Philosophical Review LXIV (1955), 3-32.
    • Before becoming an influential critic of utilitarianism, Rawls wrote this defense of rule utilitarianism.
  • Brad Hooker.  Ideal Code, Real World: A Rule-consequentialist Theory of Morality. Oxford University Press, 2000.
    • In this 21st century defense of rule utilitarianism, Hooker places it in the context of more recent developments in philosophy.
  • Peter Singer. Writings on an Ethical Life. HarperCollins, 2000.
    • Singer, a prolific, widely read thinker, mostly applies a utilitarian perspective to controversial moral issues (for example, euthanasia, the treatment of non-human animals, and global poverty) rather than discussing utilitarian moral theory. This volume contains selections from his books and articles.
  • Peter Singer. “Famine, Affluence, and Morality” in Philosophy and Public Affairs 1 (1972), 229-43. Reprinted in Peter Singer. Writings on an Ethical Life. Harper Collins, 2000.
    • This widely reprinted article, though it does not focus on utilitarianism, uses utilitarian reasoning and has sparked decades of debate about moral demandingness and moral impartiality.
  • Robert Goodin. Utilitarianism as a Public Philosophy. Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • In a series of essays, Goodin argues that utilitarianism is the best philosophy for public decision-making even if it fails as an ethic for personal aspects of life.
  • Derek Parfit.  On What Matters. Oxford University Press, 1991.
    • In a long, complex work, Parfit stresses the importance of Henry Sidgwick as a moral philosopher and argues that rule utilitarianism and Kantian deontology can be understood in a way that makes them compatible with one another.

c. Overviews

  • Tim Mulgan. Understanding Utilitarianism. Acumen, 2007.
    • This is a very clear description of utilitarianism, including explanations of arguments both for and against. Chapter 2 discusses Bentham, Mill, and Sidgwick while chapter 6 focuses on act and rule utilitarianism.
  • Julia Driver, “The History of Utilitarianism,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • This article gives a good historical account of important figures in the development of utilitarianism.
  • Walter Sinnott-Armstrong, “Consequentialism,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • This very useful overview is relevant to utilitarianism and other forms of consequentialism.
  • William Shaw. Contemporary Ethics: Taking Account of Utilitarianism. Blackwell, 1999.
    • Shaw provides a clear, comprehensive discussion of utilitarianism and its critics as well as defending utilitarianism.
  • John Troyer. The Classical Utilitarians: Bentham and Mill. Hackett, 2003.
    • Troyer’s introduction to this book of selections from Mill and Bentham is clear and informative.
  • Ben Eggleston and Dale Miller, eds. The Cambridge Companion to Utilitarianism. Cambridge University Press, 2014.
    • This collection contains sixteen essays on utilitarianism, including essays on historical figures as well as  discussion of 21st century issues, including both act and rule utilitarianism.

d. J. S. Mill and Utilitarian Moral Theory

  • J. O. Urmson. “The Interpretation of the Moral Philosophy of J. S. Mill,” in Philosophical Quarterly (1953) 3, 33-9.
    • This article generated renewed interest in both Mill’s moral theory and rule utilitarianism.
  • Roger Crisp. Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Mill on Utilitarianism. Routledge, 1997.
  • A clear discussion of Mill’s Utilitarianism with chapters on key topics as well as on Mill’s On Liberty and The Subjection of Women.
  • Henry. R. West, ed. The Blackwell Guide to Mill’s Utilitarianism. Blackwell, 2006.
    • This contains the complete text of Mill’s Utilitarianism   preceded by three essays on the background to Mill’s utilitarianism and followed by five interpretative essays and four focusing on contemporary issues.
  • Henry R. West. An Introduction to Mill’s Utilitarian Ethics. Cambridge University Press, 2004.
    • A clear discussion of Mill; Chapter 4 argues that Mill is neither an act nor a rule utilitarian. Chapter 6 focuses on utilitarianism and justice.
  • Dale Miller. J. S. Mill. Polity Press, 2010.
    • Miller, in Chapter 6, argues that Mill was a rule utilitarian.
  • Stephen Nathanson. “John Stuart Mill on Economic Justice and the Alleviation of Poverty,” in Journal of Social Philosophy, XLIII, no. 2.
    • Drawing on Mill’s Principles of Political Economy, Nathanson claims that Mill was a rule utilitarian and provides an interpretation of Mill’s views on economic justice.
  • Wendy Donner, “Mill’s Utilitarianism” in John Skorupski, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Mill. Cambridge University Press, 1998, 255–92.
    • A discussion of Mill’s views and some recent interpretations of them.
  • David Lyons. Rights, Welfare, and Mill’s Moral Theory. Oxford, 1994.
    • In this series of papers, Lyons defends Mill’s view of morality against some critics, differentiates Mill’s views from  both act and rule utilitarianism, and criticizes Mill’s attempt to show that utilitarianism can account for justice.

e. Critics of Utilitarianism

  • David Lyons.  Forms and Limits of Utilitarianism. Oxford, 1965.
    • Lyons argues that at least some versions of rule utilitarianism collapse into act utilitarianism.
  • David Lyons. “The Moral Opacity of Utilitarianism” in Brad Hooker, Elinor Mason, and Dale Miller, eds. Morality, Rules, and Consequences. Rowman and Littlefield, 2000.
    • In a challenging essay, Lyons raises doubts about whether there is any coherent version of utilitarianism.
  • Judith Jarvis Thomson. “The Trolley Problem.” Yale Law Journal 94 (1985), 1395-1415. Reprinted in Judith Jarvis Thomson. Rights, Restitution and Risk. Edited by William Parent. Harvard University Press, 1986; Chapter 7.
    • An influential rights-based discussion in which Jarvis Thomson uses hypothetical cases to show, among other things, that utilitarianism cannot explain while some actions that cause killings are permissible and others not.
  • Bernard Williams, “A Critique of Utilitarianism,” In J. J. C. Smart and Bernard Williams, Utilitarianism: For and Against. Cambridge University Press, 1973.
    • Williams’ contribution to this debate contains arguments and examples that have played an important role in debates about utilitarianism and moral theory.

f. Collections of Essays

  • Michael D. Bayles, ed. Contemporary Utilitarianism. Garden City: Doubleday, 1968.
    • Ten essays that debate act vs. rule utilitarianism as well as whether a form of utilitarianism is correct.
  • Samuel Gorovitz, ed. John Stuart Mill: Utilitarianism, With Critical Essays. Indianapolis: The Bobbs-Merrill Company, 1971.
    • This includes Mill’s Utlitarianism plus a rich array of twenty-eight (pre-1970) articles interpreting, defending, and criticizing utilitarianism.
  • Brad Hooker, Elinor Mason, and Dale Miller, eds. Morality, Rules, and Consequences. Rowman and Littlefield, 2000.
    • Thirteen essays on utilitarianism, many focused on issues concerning rule utilitarianism.
  • Samuel Scheffler. Consequentialism and Its Critics. Oxford, 1988.
    • This contains a dozen influential articles, mostly by prominent critics of utilitarianism and other forms of consequentialism.
  • Amartya Sen, and Bernard Williams, eds. Utilitarianism and Beyond. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982.
    • This contains fourteen articles, including essays defending utilitarianism by R. M. Hare and John Harsanyi, As the title suggests, however, most of the articles are critical of utilitarianism.


Author Information

Stephen Nathanson
Northeastern University
U. S. A.


Desert is a normative concept that is used in day-to-day life.  Many believe that being treated as one deserves to be treated is a matter of justice, fairness, or rightness.  Although desert claims come in a variety of forms, generally they are claims about some positive or negative treatment that someone or something ought to receive.  One might claim that a hard-working employee deserves a raise, an exceptional student deserves an academic scholarship, a dishonest politician deserves to lose an election, or a thief deserves to be imprisoned.  But while such appeals to desert are common, there are a number of unsettled issues regarding the concept of desert itself and its relevance to justice.  For example, it is common for people to claim that things other than humans, such as nonhuman animals or inanimate objects, can be deserving.  How should we assess such claims?  Some argue that desert presupposes responsibility.  But must this be the case?  According to some theories, desert is an important component of justice.  Yet according to other theories, it has little or no role in justice.  Some even question whether desert itself is a defensible concept.  This article is designed to capture the scholarly agreement about these and other issues regarding desert.  Where there is not such agreement, overviews of some of the competing accounts are presented.

Table of Contents

  1. The Structure of Desert
    1. Deserving Subjects
    2. Deserved Modes of Treatment
    3. Desert Bases
      1. Desert and Responsibility
      2. Desert and Time
  2. Desert and Some Related Concepts
    1. Merit
    2. Entitlement
  3. The Role of Desert in Justice
    1. Desert in Distributive and Retributive Justice
    2. Desert, Institutions, and Justice
  4. Meritocracy
  5. Some Arguments against Desert
    1. Rawls’s Metaphysical Argument
    2. The Epistemological and Pragmatic Arguments
    3. Libertarian Arguments
  6. Concluding Remarks
  7. References and Further Reading

1. The Structure of Desert

It is widely held that desert is a relation among three elements: a subject, a mode of treatment or state of affairs deserved by the subject, and some fact or facts about the subject, which are often referred to as desert base or desert bases (McLeod 1999a, 61-62; Pojman 2006, 21; Sher 1987, 7).  This relation is shown in the formula:

S deserves M in virtue of B,

where S is the subject, M is the mode of treatment, and B is the desert base or bases. Each of these elements will be examined in greater detail.

a. Deserving Subjects

One’s view about who or what are the appropriate subjects of desert is going to be influenced by one’s view about what desert requires on the part of a subject.  If one thinks that merely having a quality or feature is sufficient to establish desert, then one will place few restrictions on the kinds of things that can be deserving.  If one thinks that having some baseline self-awareness is sufficient to make one the appropriate subject of desert, then nonhuman animals such as bottlenose dolphins and chimpanzees can be appropriate bearers of desert.  If one thinks that desert requires a certain level of responsibility, then one will advocate for a conception that places stricter limits on who or what qualify as deserving subjects.  While there is some disagreement in the literature, most who theorize about desert view human beings, or at least some subset of human beings, as appropriate subjects of desert  A very broad conception of desert might seek to extend the concept to apply to certain or all sentient creatures, living things in general, or even inanimate objects.  In fact, common language usage seems to support such a broad understanding.  One might claim that Gone with the Wind deserves its reputation as one of the greatest movies ever made or that K2 deserves its reputation as one of the most difficult mountains to climb.  But such a broad understanding of desert might involve problematic conflations of desert with other concepts.  For example, while one might think Gone with the Wind’s lofty reputation is appropriate, one might argue that, strictly speaking, its reputation is not deserved.  Instead, one might argue that in the cases of movies, mountains, and the like, the proposed desert claims are best understood as nothing more than general claims about how something should be judged or about what something should have or receive.  So, in an effort to maintain conceptual clarity, it might be best to attribute some common uses of the term ‘desert’ to inexact language usage.  A survey of the literature suggests some support for both broader (Schmidtz 2002, 777) and narrower uses of the term (Miller 1999, 137-138).

b. Deserved Modes of Treatment

Subjects are said to deserve a wide variety of things.  The modes of treatment or states of affairs that one can deserve can be classified as positive or negative outcomes, harms or benefits, or gains or losses (Kristjánsson 2003, 41).  Positive modes of treatment include such things as awards, compensation, good luck, jobs, praise, prizes, remuneration, rewards, and success.  Negative modes of treatment include such things as bad luck, blame, censure, failure, fines, and punishment.  Oftentimes, a deserved mode of treatment will incorporate a source or supplier of that treatment.  For example, one might argue that an athlete deserves praise from his manager.  But such a source need not be specified in all cases since legitimate desert claims need not be directed toward any source.  This is, in part, because legitimate desert claims need not be enforceable or even prescribe any action.  Consider the claim that certain hardworking people deserve good fortune.  While this is a legitimate desert claim, it need not be directed toward any source and it need not result in a call for any corrective action in cases in which particular hardworking people have not had good fortune (Kekes 1997, 124).

c. Desert Bases

There are a variety of ways in which desert bases can be categorized.  Two categories that are commonly used in the philosophical literature are desert based on effort and desert based on performance.  Some accounts of desert focus primarily on one’s effort toward achieving some goal.  Usually the goal has to be viewed as worthwhile, since quixotic effort is rarely considered to be a basis for desert.  Some argue that desert is not based solely, or even primarily, on effort, but also on one’s performance in a given context.  The performance can be any number of activities that give rise to positive or negative evaluation, such as the winning of a race or performing poorly in a music competition.  In some contexts, the performance can be assessed in terms of the contribution that one makes as a part of some group, such as a family, company, community, or even a society as a whole.  Depending on the context, this contribution can be measured in terms of productivity, success, or some other similar measure. Michael Boylan presents a thought experiment that raises questions concerning how one’s effort and performance often are, and how they should be weighed as factors in determining one’s desert.  We are presented with two puzzle makers.  The first puzzle maker is presented with a puzzle that is 80 percent complete, and he finishes the puzzle by completing the remaining 20 percent.  The second puzzle maker is presented with a puzzle that is totally incomplete.  He manages to complete 80 percent of the puzzle, and therefore does not finish it (2004, p. 139 ff). Boylan notes that, according to a common interpretation, the first puzzle maker would be the one who deserves the credit, and the resultant spoils, for completing the puzzle.  But why should this puzzle maker get more credit when he completed significantly less of the puzzle?  He cannot claim credit for, and therefore cannot claim to deserve, receiving the puzzle in a more advanced stage of completion, since he did nothing to bring the puzzle to that stage of completion. The puzzle maker example highlights important issues regarding the nature and use of desert.  First, there is the question of what basis or bases one should use to determine desert.  Should effort, performance, or some combination of the two be used?  Are there other criteria that ought to be used?  Second, even if one determines that effort and performance are the relevant desert bases, then one must still determine how to correctly weigh the two in a given situation.

i. Desert and Responsibility

As noted above, one’s view about who or what can qualify as a deserving subject will be influenced by one’s view of the role of responsibility in establishing desert.  Some have argued that at least some type of responsibility is a necessary condition for all desert (Smilansky 1996a, 1996b), whereas others have argued that, in at least some cases, one can deserve some mode of treatment without anyone being responsible for the desert base that gives rise to that mode of treatment (Feldman 1995, 1996).  An example of responsibility without desert could be cases in which a victim of theft is said to deserve compensation even though he was not responsible for having his money stolen.  In such a case, however, there is still someone, namely the thief, who is responsible for the desert base.  Others might offer desert claims based on suffering that people endure at the hands of beings with dubious levels of responsibility, such as children, mentally handicapped or emotionally disturbed adults, and nonhuman animals.  Some argue that there can be desert in cases in which the suffering is not caused by any being, such as when people suffer as the result of a natural phenomenon.  One who supports this view might argue that a tornado victim can deserve financial support as a result of his suffering through that natural disaster. So, one can argue that while certain cases of desert require responsibility, not all do.  In at least some cases, one can attempt to maintain a connection between desert and responsibility by appealing to a notion of negative responsibility.  That is, one can argue that if someone suffers a misfortune for which she is not responsible, and this misfortune causes her to fall below some baseline condition, then she can deserve some treatment as a result of her suffering (Smilansky 1996a, 1996b).  Alternatively, one could argue that cases like those of the crime and tornado victims are not cases of genuine desert.  One might argue that in situations in which a person suffers through no fault of her own she might be due compensation, and while it is a matter of justice whether she receives compensation, strictly speaking she does not deserve compensation.

ii. Desert and Time

Most desert theorists argue that desert is strictly a backward-looking concept.  According to this standard view, a person’s desert is based strictly on past and present facts about him (Rachels 1997, 176; Feinberg 1970, 72; Miller 1976, 93).  The view that desert must be backward looking has been challenged, however.  According to these alternative, forward-looking accounts, certain legitimate desert claims can be based on future performances (Feldman 1995, Schmidtz 2002).  This forward-looking view has been questioned based in part on a concern that it relies on instances of desert without legitimately grounded desert bases.  The argument is that in order for a person to deserve something at a given time there must be some relevant fact about the person at that time that gives rise to his desert.  The concern is that a desert base with sufficient grounding conditions that lie in the future cannot be such a fact, for it is metaphysically dubious (Celello 2009, 156).

2. Desert and Some Related Concepts

Desert is one of many concepts that are used to assess the appropriateness of what one does or should have.  Prior to discussing the role of desert in justice, it is worthwhile to consider a couple of these other concepts.

a. Merit

There is not a consensus on how to understand the relationship between desert and merit.  Some argue that the terms ‘desert’ and ‘merit’ do not identify separate concepts.  And, in ordinary language, the two are often used interchangeably (McLeod 1999a, 67).  But many scholars have offered important distinctions between the two concepts.  One way to distinguish between the two is to claim that merit should understood more broadly than desert, since merit results from any quality or feature of a subject that serves as a basis for the positive or negative treatment of that subject even if that treatment is not strictly speaking deserved.  On this account, desert is a species of the genus merit (Pojman 1997, 22-23).  Although scholars discuss other distinguishing factors, e.g. effort and intention, a main factor used to distinguish desert from merit is responsibility.  David Miller claims that a distinction between desert and merit is supported by the ways in which the two are discussed in contemporary discourse (1999, 125).  He notes that ‘merit’ is used to refer to a person’s admirable qualities whereas ‘desert’ is used in cases in which someone is responsible for a particular result.  One who supports such a distinction might claim that a person can merit treatment based on factors over which he has little or no control, based on characteristics that he did little to develop, and based on performances that required very little effort.  For example, a man can merit, but not deserve, admiration for his native good looks.  In addition, since merit does not require responsibility, it can apply to a wide variety of things, including nonhuman animals and even inanimate objects.

b. Entitlement

Understood in one way, entitlement claims are specific to particular associations, organizations, or institutions.  Entitlement results from a subject having a claim or right to some treatment as a result of following the rules or meeting some explicit criterion or criteria of an association, organization, or institution.  Although certain entitlements might be related to or give rise to desert (McLeod 1999b, 192), it is important to keep the two concepts distinct.  There are many situations in which one deserves some treatment without being entitled to that treatment or in which one is entitled to something that one does not also deserve.  Consider an automobile race in which the leading driver is caused to wreck by debris on the track.  As a result, he crashes just prior to crossing the finish line.  In such races, crossing the finish line first is the criterion used to establish the winner.  If the crash prevented the driver from winning, one could reasonably argue that, although the driver is not entitled to win, he deserved to win because he had made the requisite effort, performed better than all of the other drivers for the entire race leading up to the crash, and was clearly going to win before he crashed.  In addition to the fact that one can deserve something that one is not entitled to, one can be entitled to something that one does not deserve.  Based on the laws of his country, an evil dictator could be entitled to a subject’s property that the dictator seized on a whim, but this does not mean that the dictator deserves the property.  To use another common example, a son might be entitled to an inheritance left to him by his father, but he might not have done anything to deserve that inheritance.

3. The Role of Desert in Justice

In a general sense, justice can be understood to consist in persons getting what is appropriate or fitting for them.  This idea of justice can be traced back to ancient times.  Plato discussed justice in general, and distributive justice in particular, as involving a type of appropriateness or fittingness of treatment (Republic 1.332bc).  According to some translations of Laws, Plato suggested that justice involves treating people as they deserve to be treated (6.757cd). Although there are many important differences between their theories, Aristotle joined Plato by arguing that justice involves a type of equality.  In Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle maintained that distributive justice involves judging people according to certain criteria in order to determine whether they are equal or unequal.  He argued that, in distributions, it is just for equals to receive equal shares, unjust for equals to receive unequal shares, and unjust for those who are unequal to receive equal shares.  He maintained that what each person receives should be geometrically proportional to the degree or extent to which his or her actions fit or match these criteria (5.3.1131a10-b16).  People are judged based on normative concepts such as desert, merit, and entitlement to determine whether they are equal or unequal.  Consider a distributive context in which two people are to be treated based on what each deserves.  According to the idea of geometrical proportionality, if one person is twice as deserving as the other, then she ought to receive twice the share of what is to be distributed. According to the classical tradition, desert is one of the conceptual components of justice.  But it is not understood as being the only conceptual component of justice.  The Greek word axia, a word used by both Plato and Aristotle in their discussions of the distribution of things such as goods, honors, and services, can be translated as, or understood to include, “desert”.  But, in certain contexts, it might be misleading to translate axia as ‘desert’ instead of translating it as ‘merit’ or some other related concept (Miller 1999, 125-126). Desert has a prominent role in certain more recent conceptions of justice, such as those of John Stuart Mill and Henry Sidgwick.  In Utilitarianism, Mill claimed that it is considered just when a person gets whatever good or evil he deserves and unjust when he receives a good or suffers an evil that he does not deserve (2001, 45).  Sidgwick argued that justice involved one’s desert being requited (1907, 280 ff).  According to some contemporary theories of justice, often referred to as “pluralist” theories, desert is one among other important conceptual components of justice.  These other components can include, but need not be limited to, entitlement, equality, merit, need, reciprocity, and moral worth.  According to these theories, whether and to what extent desert is relevant to justice depends on the context in which the judgment is being made.  And, when desert conflicts with the other components of justice, it must be measured against them in order to determine what justice requires (Miller 1999, 133; Schmidtz 2006, 4).

a. Desert in Distributive and Retributive Justice

Some scholars argue that desert’s role in distributive justice and retributive justice is symmetrical, i.e., that desert is more or less equally relevant in both (Sher 1987; Pojman 2006, 126).  There is disagreement in the literature as to whether desert’s role ought to be understood in this way (Moriarty 2003; Smilansky 2006).  Those who argue in favor of an asymmetry in desert’s role may attempt to explain the asymmetry in different ways.  Some might argue that desert is relevant in retributive justice but not in distributive justice because being the appropriate recipient of a harm requires a level of responsibility that being the appropriate recipient of a benefit does not.  Or, some might argue in favor of the asymmetry based on the differing modes of treatment that are called for in distributive and retributive contexts.  The motivating idea used to support this view is that desert is an appropriate and important basis for punishment, but other concepts, e.g. equality and need, are the appropriate bases for distributions of goods and services.  Even if one recognizes desert as an important conceptual component of both distributive and retributive justice, one might argue that desert differs in these different spheres.  For example, one might argue that desert in distributive justice can be forward looking, while desert in retributive justice cannot (Feldman 1995, 74-76; Schmidtz 2002, 783-784).

b. Desert, Institutions, and Justice

In many cases, what one is said to deserve is connected to a certain convention or practice within an association, organization, or larger social institution.  One cannot deserve first place in an automobile race if there are not any such competitions, nor can an employee at a steel mill deserve a raise absent the existence of the steel mill and the economic system of which the steel mill is some very small part.  In the light of such examples, some scholars claim that, if it is a defensible concept at all, desert cannot exist in the absence of such institutional conventions or practices (Cummiskey 1987).  This idea leads some scholars to offer what they view as an important distinction between pre-institutional desert (p-desert) and institutional desert (i-desert). Those who recognize p-desert argue that although specific desert bases or deserved modes of treatment are often defined within a particular associational, organizational, or institutional context, desert is a concept that is logically prior to and independent of both tacit and explicit institutional criteria and rules.  They argue that the conflation of p-desert with i-desert is based on a failure to recognize the distinction between desert as a general normative concept and a particular type of desert that is influenced by institutions.  According to this view, the distinction between p-desert and i-desert is based on an important difference between one deserving something regardless of whether one is a part of an institution and deserving a specific thing based mostly or wholly on institutional criteria or rules.  The reason why someone deserves a specific trophy made of a specific material for his effort and performance toward winning a particular automobile race is because there is an institution that holds and regulates such an event.  But the underlying reason why the person deserves something for winning the automobile race is that, pre-institutionally, effort and performance give rise to desert. Some argue that rejecting p-desert is problematic since, without it, there is no independent normative concept of desert.  That is, there is no concept of desert that is external to any given institution which can be used to evaluate the justice of institutions.  Another difficulty with the rejection of p-desert is that it would disallow the seemingly reasonable claim that a person can deserve something even if she is not a part of any identifiable institution.  One could argue that a person could deserve something in a state of nature or that she could deserve something even if she were the last person on Earth.  If she were to work hard to build a shelter and grow crops, for example, one could argue that she thereby deserves the benefits that resulted from those activities. Some who argue that John Rawls’s theory of justice as fairness allows for desert in distributive contexts interpret his theory as advancing a purely institutional conception of desert.  Samuel Scheffler (2000) argues that Rawls rejects prejusticial desert and not pre-institutional desert, however.  According to Scheffler, Rawls rejects prejusticial desert because Rawls thinks that desert can exist only after the principles of justice have been established.  Scheffler interprets Rawls as arguing that a person deserves whatever it is that justice dictates he should receive and only what justice dictates he should receive.  On this view, desert is not prejusticial since desert is defined in terms of justice as opposed to justice being defined, at least in part, in terms of desert.  But justice is understood as being pre-institutional since justice is a normative concept, external to any particular institution, which can be used to judge institutions.  The rejection of prejusticial desert will be viewed as problematic by those who, following more traditional conceptions of justice, define justice, at least in part, in terms of desert.  The concern is that defining desert in terms of justice, instead of defining justice in terms of desert, results in a backward understanding of the relationship between the two concepts.

4. Meritocracy

In general, a meritocracy is a social system in which advancement, reward, and status are based on individual abilities and talents.  In theory, those who are more able and talented would advance further, reap greater rewards, and achieve loftier status.  Meritocracy can involve attempting to erect a basic structure of society according to the ideas of a meritocracy or it can involve attempting to implement a system in which a society’s basic institutions are governed, at least in part, by principles of awarding jobs and specifying rewards for jobs on the basis of merit.  Although the two issues are sometimes conflated, Norman Daniels notes that whether someone merits a job is separate from what rewards are attached to that job.  So, while a person might merit a particular job of great importance, one should not assume that he merits higher wages or greater rewards than another person who merits a job of much less importance (Daniels, 218-219). As discussed above, there is some scholarly disagreement about the relationship between merit and desert.  For those who offer clear distinctions between the two, a social system in which advancement, reward, and status were based on desert would be different from one in which such benefits were based on merit.  A system of merit would be based on persons’ abilities and talents, whereas a system based on desert would focus on persons’ efforts and performances for which they are responsible.  As a result, although the creation of either would be difficult, the creation of a system based on desert, a “desertocracy” if you will, seems to be more problematic than one based on merit.  This is because a desertocracy would seem to require more, and more specific, information about persons than would a meritocracy.

5. Some Arguments against Desert

While many consider desert to be an important conceptual component of justice, others have argued against this view.  Some argue that the concept of desert itself is problematic.  This is known as the metaphysical argument against desert.  Others claim that, even if desert is a defensible concept, determining what people deserve or treating people according to what they deserve is not feasible.  These ideas are defended in the epistemological and pragmatic arguments against desert.  Some maintain that, regardless of the force of the metaphysical, epistemological, or pragmatic arguments, desert does not have a prominent role in distributive justice.  Examples of this view can be found in right- and left-libertarian theories of justice.

a. Rawls’s Metaphysical Argument

Among the contemporary theories of justice in which desert does not have a prominent role, John Rawls’s is the most often discussed.  Drawing from Herbert Spiegelberg’s (1944, 113) idea that the inequalities of birth are types of underserved discrimination, Rawls (1971, 104) claims that desert does not apply to one’s place in the distribution of native endowments, one’s initial starting place in society, i.e. the familial and social circumstances into which one is born, or to the superior character that enables one to put forth the effort to develop one’s abilities.  As is often the case with Rawls’s work, as evidenced by the discussion of pre-institutional and prejusticial desert above, there are many competing interpretations of his views on the relationship between desert and justice.  Yet, regardless of which of these interpretations is correct, Rawls work suggests a metaphysical argument against desert. According to this metaphysical argument, since most of who we are and what we do is greatly influenced by undeserved native endowments and by the undeserved circumstances into which we are born, one cannot deserve anything, or, at best, one can deserve very little.  According to a common interpretation, Rawls believes that desert should not have any role in distributive justice, since these undeserved factors have a major influence on all would-be desert bases (Sher 1987, 22 ff).  Others contend that Rawls does allow for some limited amount of desert (Moriarty 2002, 136-137).  Regardless of whether Rawls does allow for some limited amount of desert, if sound, the metaphysical argument against desert would either substantially or completely undermine the concept.

b. The Epistemological and Pragmatic Arguments

David Hume was an early critic of those theories of distributive justice in which merit was assigned a prominent role.  Although, as discussed above, there are differences between the concepts of desert and merit, and although Hume’s use of  the term ‘merit’ differs from more modern uses, the kinds of arguments that Hume offered against merit are often used against desert in contemporary discussions.  Hume argued that since humans are both fallible in their knowledge of the factors that would establish others’ merit and prone to overestimating their own merit, distributive schemes based on merit could not result in determinate rules of conduct and would be utterly destructive to society (Hume, 27).  This thinking is captured in the epistemological and pragmatic arguments against desert. According to the epistemological argument, since we cannot know the specific details of the lives of every member in a community or society, we cannot accurately treat people according to their desert.  Recall that effort and performance are commonly cited as appropriate desert bases.  Even if one agrees that only effort and performance should be used to determine one’s desert, concerns about how such determinations could be made with any accuracy or consistency still remain.  How could one know how much of a person’s performance was the result of effort as opposed to natural talent, brute luck, or any other number of complicating factors?  The pragmatic argument against desert is that, regardless of whether we could gain the knowledge needed to treat people according to their desert accurately, attempting to do so would have overriding negative consequences.  Such negative consequences could include expending large amounts of time and resources in an effort to make accurate desert judgments and, perhaps, losses of personal privacy as one delves into the details of others’ lives. Both the epistemological and pragmatic arguments must be accounted for when attempting to explain how a true meritocracy could and should be arranged.  Those who do not advocate meritocracies on a large scale might overcome the difficulties suggested by the epistemological and pragmatic arguments by maintaining that the use of desert should be limited to smaller, local contexts.  According to this view, since it is easier to determine a person’s desert in contexts that are limited in size and scope, accurate desert judgments would be both possible and feasible in such contexts.

c. Libertarian Arguments

According to Libertarianism, each individual agent fully owns himself.  As a full self-owner, the agent is entitled to use his various abilities to acquire property rights in the world.  For the libertarian, the primary goal of justice is the protection of negative liberty.  Based on a principle of non-interference, negative liberty is understood as the absence of constraints on an individual’s actions. Some mark a distinction between right-libertarianism and left-libertarianism.  Perhaps the most well-known explication of right-libertarianism, which is often understood as the traditional version of libertarianism, is given by Robert Nozick in Anarchy, State, and Utopia.  Nozick advances an entitlement theory of justice.  On this view, a just distribution is one in which each person is entitled to the holdings that she possesses according to the principles of justice in acquisition, transfer, and rectification. Nozick describes his entitlement theory as “historical,” because it determines the justice of holdings on the basis of how those holdings came to be held, and “unpatterned,” because the justice of holdings is not determined on the basis of some additional normative criteria, such as merit, need, or effort (1974, 155 ff).  Because meritocracies are patterned, Nozick would reject them.  Right-libertarians would be concerned with liberty-restricting attempts at distributing or redistributing resources according to prevailing conceptions of merit or desert.  Therefore, the concept of desert does not have a major role in their theories of justice.   Libertarians need not reject the concept of desert entirely, however.  And Nozick offers various arguments against Rawls’s rejection of desert (1974, 215 ff).  For the right-libertarian, desert could be a concept for the individual to consider in his personal decision-making processes, but not one that the state should use to try to guide allocations or distributions of resources. As with right-libertarianism, left-libertarianism is based on the idea that each individual agent fully owns himself.  But the left-libertarian view about the appropriation of natural resources differs greatly from the right-libertarian view.  Left-libertarians believe in the egalitarian ownership of natural resources.  Anyone who appropriates a natural resource would have to pay others for the value of that resource.  Such a payment might then be placed into a social fund, from which distributions to other members of a society are made.  The resources are divided according to egalitarian principles and not on the basis of merit or desert.  The rejection of desert as a basis of distribution could be based on the metaphysical argument that, strictly speaking, people do not deserve anything.  Or, a left-libertarian could recognize desert as a distributive concept, but one that is less important than equality.  According to such a view, equality, and not desert, should be the primary basis of distribution within a society.

6. Concluding Remarks

Despite its use in daily life, desert is a concept that remains somewhat nebulous.   Regardless of certain areas of disagreement, those who recognize desert as an important normative concept generally agree on a number of issues regarding the nature of desert.  One point of general agreement is that desert consists of, at least, three main parts – a subject, a mode of treatment, and a desert base.  In addition, scholars generally argue in favor of the view that desert is applicable to human beings, or at least some subset of them.  Lastly, scholars generally agree that understanding the nature of desert is important to understanding the nature of justice.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle. Nicomachean Ethics. 2nd Ed.  Translated, with an Introduction, by Terence Irwin.  Indianapolis: Hackett, 1999.
    • An accessible translation that also includes detailed notes and a glossary.
  • Boylan, Michael.  A Just Society.  Lanham, MD: Rowan & Littlefield, 2004.
    • Presents a worldview theory of ethics and social philosophy.
  • Celello, Peter. “Against Desert as a Forward-Looking Concept.” Journal of Applied Philosophy 26, no.2  (May 2009): 144-159.
    • Argues that desert should be understood as a strictly backward-looking concept.
  • Cummiskey, David. “Desert and Entitlement: A Rawlsian Consequentialist Account.” Analysis, 47, no. 1 (Jan., 1987): 15-19.
    • Advances an institution-dependent account of desert.
  • Daniels, Norman.  “Merit and Meritocracy.” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 7, no. 3 (1978): 206-233.
    • A discussion of meritocracy, and the meriting of both jobs and the rewards attached to those jobs.
  • Feinberg, Joel. Doing and Deserving: Essay in the Theory of Responsibility. Princeton: PrincetonUniversity Press, 1970.
    • A collection of previously published essays, and previously unpublished lectures, focused on issues surrounding the harm and benefit of others.
  • Feldman, Fred. “Desert: Reconsideration of Some Received Wisdom.” Mind, New Series 104, no. 413 (January 1995): 63-77.
    • Argues against the ideas that desert must be backward-looking and that desert requires responsibility.
  • Feldman, Fred. “Responsibility as a Condition for Desert.” Mind, New Series 105, no. 417 (January 1996): 165-68.
    • A reply to Smilansky’s “The Connection between Responsibility and Desert: The Crucial Distinction,” in which Feldman argues that Smilansky’s solution to maintaining a connection between desert and responsibility fails.
  • Hume, David. An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals. Edited by J. B. Schneewind. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 1983.
    • A presentation of Hume’s moral philosophy in which he develops ideas from Book III of A Treatise of Human Nature.
  • Kekes, John. Against Liberalism. Ithaca, NY: CornellUniversity Press, 1997.
    • A sustained criticism of political liberalism, which includes a defense of the view that justice should be understood to combine desert and consistency.
  • Kristjánsson, Kristján. “Justice, Desert, and Virtue Revisited.” Social Theory and Practice 29, no. 1 (January 2003): 39-63.
    • Argues that the sole basis for desert is moral virtue.
  • McLeod, Owen. “Contemporary Interpretations of Desert: Introduction.” In Pojman and McLeod, eds., (1999a): 61-69.
    • A brief essay about desert, its bases, and its relation to other concepts.
  • McLeod, Owen. “Desert and Institutions.” In Pojman and McLeod, eds., (1999b): 186-95.
    • Argues that some desert is institutional and some is preinstitutional.
  • Mill, John Stuart. Utilitarianism. 2nd ed. Edited by George Sher. Indianapolis: Hackett, 2001.
    • Mill’s highly influential explication of the normative ethical theory of utilitarianism.
  • Miller, David. Principles of Social Justice. Cambridge, MA: HarvardUniversity Press, 1999.
    • A theory of social justice that includes detailed treatments of the concept of desert and its role in justice.
  • Miller, David. Social Justice. Oxford: OxfordUniversity Press, 1976.
    • A work on social justice, including a chapter devoted to desert.
  • Moriarty, Jeffrey. “Against the Asymmetry of Desert.” Nous 37, no. 3 (2003): 518–536.
    • Argues against the view that desert can have an important role in retributive justice, while not having an important role in distributive justice.
  • Moriarty, Jeffrey. “Desert and Distributive Justice in A Theory of Justice.” Journal of Social Philosophy 33, no. 1 (Spring 2002): 131-43.
    • Argues that John Rawls recognizes pre-institutional desert and that Rawls’s failure to consider such desert in his theory of justice seems unjust.
  • Nozick, Robert. Anarchy, State, and Utopia. New York: Basic Books, 1974.
    • An influential defense of libertarian principles.
  • Plato. Laws. Translated by Trevor J. Saunders. In Plato: Complete Works, edited by John Cooper. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1997.
  • Plato. Republic. Translated by G. M. A. Grube.  Revised by C. D. C. Reeve. In Plato: Complete Works.
    • The Complete Works contains recent translations of all of Plato’s works, dubia, and spuria.
  • Pojman, Louis. “Equality and Desert.” Philosophy, 72, no. 282 (Oct. 1997): 549-570.
    • Argues that the underlying justification of punishment and reward is desert or merit.
  • Pojman, Louis. Justice. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Pearson, 2006.
    • An accessible introduction to different theories of justice, which includes a chapter on justice as desert.
  • Pojman, Louis, and Owen McLeod, eds. What Do We Deserve?: A Reader on Justice and Desert. New York: OxfordUniversity Press, 1999.
    • Contains selections from many influential works on desert and its role in justice.
  • Rachels, James. “What People Deserve.” In Can Ethics Provide Answers?: And Other Essays in Moral Philosophy, 175-97. Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997.
    • A chapter on desert, which includes a discussion of the relationship between desert and responsibility and a    discussion of desert’s temporal orientation.
  • Rawls, John. A Theory of Justice. Cambridge, MA: HarvardUniversity Press, 1971.
    • Rawls’s seminal work in which he advances a theory of justice as fairness.
  • Scheffler, Samuel. “Justice and Desert in Liberal Theory.” California Law Review 88 (May 2000): 965-90.
    • Discusses Rawls’s view on the asymmetry between desert’s role in distributive and retributive justice, and argues that Rawls rejects prejusticial, but not pre-institutional desert.
  • Schmidtz, David. Elements of Justice. Cambridge: CambridgeUniversity Press, 2006.
    • Argues for a pluralist theory of justice based on principles of equality, desert, need, and reciprocity.
  • Schmidtz, David. “How to Deserve.” Political Theory 30, no. 6 (December 2002): 774-99.
    • Includes a “promissory account” of desert, which has forward-looking aspects.
  • Sher, George. Desert. Princeton: PrincetonUniversity Press, 1987.
    • A detailed examination of desert and its role in justice.
  • Sidgwick, Henry. The Methods of Ethics. 7th ed. London: Macmillan, 1907.
    • His seminal work in which he discusses egoism, intuitional morality, and utilitarianism.
  • Smilansky, Saul. “The Connection between Responsibility and Desert: The Crucial Distinction.” Mind, New Series 105, no. 419 (July 1996a): 485-86.
    • A reply to Feldman’s “Desert: Reconsideration of Some Received Wisdom,” in which Smilansky argues that there is a connection between desert and responsibility.
  • Smilansky, Saul.  “Control, Desert, and the Difference between Distributive and Retributive Justice.  Philosophical Studies, 131(3) (2006): 511–524.
    • Provides a defense of the asymmetry between desert’s role in distributive and retributive justice.
  • Smilansky, Saul. “Responsibility and Desert: Defending the Connection.” Mind, New Series 105, no. 417 (January 1996b): 157-63.
    • A reply to Feldman in which Smilansky argues for a distinction between positive and negative responsibility conditions for desert.
  • Spiegelberg, Herbert. “A Defense of Human Equality.” Philosophical Review 53, no. 2 (1944): 101-24.
    • Defends an ethical principle of human equality, and a view of justice based on that principle.


Author Information

Peter Celello
Ohio State University Newark
U. S. A.

Ethics and Contrastivism

A contrastive theory of some concept holds that the concept in question only applies or fails to apply relative to a set of alternatives. Contrastivism has been applied to a wide range of philosophically important topics, including several topics in ethics. Contrastivism about reasons, for example, holds that whether some consideration is a reason for some action depends on what we are comparing that action to. The fact that your guests are vegetarian is a reason to make vegetable lasagna rather than make roast duck, but not a reason to make vegetable lasagna rather than make mushroom risotto. Contrastivism about obligation holds that what agents are obligated to do can likewise vary with the alternatives. So, for example, you may be obligated to take the book back to the library rather than leave it on your shelf, but not obligated to take the book back to the library rather than send it to the library with a friend. The article begins by clarifying what contrastivism is more generally, in order to see what motivates philosophers to accept contrastivism about some topic. Along the way, challenges and choice points facing the contrastivist will be highlighted. Attention is then given to exploring arguments for, and applications of, contrastivism to topics in ethics, including obligations, reasons, and freedom and responsibility.

Table of Contents

  1. Contrastivism in General
    1. Contrastivism in Different Domains
      1. Epistemology
      2. Philosophy of Science
    2. Contrastivism and Questions
    3. Non-Exhaustivity and Resolution-Sensitivity
  2. Contrastivism in Ethics
    1. Contrastivism about Obligation
    2. Contrastivism and Freedom
    3. Contrastivism about Normative Reasons
  3. General Challenges
    1. Setting the Contrast Class
    2. Cross-Context Inferences
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Contrastivism in General

In this section we will briefly introduce the broad range of topics that have received a contrastive treatment in areas outside of ethics, and see what kinds of arguments contrastivists about some concept deploy. This will give us a broad outline of contrastivism as a general kind of view in philosophy.

a. Contrastivism in Different Domains

i. Epistemology

One of the most well known applications of contrastivism relates to knowledge. There are also contrastive theories of justification and of belief, but I will focus here on knowledge. According to the traditional, non-contrastive conception of knowledge, it is a two-place relation holding between a subject and a proposition: Ksps knows that p. Contrastivism, on the other hand, holds that knowledge is a three-place relation holding between a subject, a proposition, and a contrast.

There are differences in conceptions of the contrast. Some contrastivists treat the contrast as a single proposition, q, incompatible with p, yielding Kspqs knows that p rather than q. Others treat the contrast as a set of mutually exclusive propositions, including p, Q, yielding KspQs knows that p out of Q, where Q may be {p, q, r, s}. This difference is non-essential, at least for most purposes, since we can translate from Kspq to KspQ by letting Q = {p, q}, and we can translate from KspQ to Kspq, where Q = {p, r, s, t}, by letting q = r˅s˅t. Many examples used in arguments for contrastivism involve the phrase “rather than”, which generally contrasts two propositions (“s knows that p rather than q”). So for these examples, the single proposition conception of the contrast is more natural. Nevertheless, we will adopt the set of alternatives conception. As we will see in the section Contrastivism and Questions, this conception more directly represents the important contrastivist idea that contrastivity can be thought of as question-relativity.

Contrastivism about knowledge has its roots in the relevant alternatives contextualist theory of knowledge, developed in, for example, Dretske (1970) and Lewis (1996). According to this theory, whether a knowledge ascription, “s knows that p”, is true in a context depends on which alternatives to p are relevant in that context, and whether s can rule them out. As the context varies, the relevant alternatives may vary, and so whether a knowledge ascription is true can also vary. Relevant alternatives theorists have worked to spell out what makes an alternative relevant in a context, but have not yet produced a very satisfying picture. Contrastivists claim to do better: the relevant alternatives are provided by a question under discussion, which we have independent reason to accept in our theory of communication. For example, linguists (for example, Roberts, 201)) have argued that positing such a question under discussion helps explain various linguistic phenomena.

Contrastivists about knowledge claim several advantages over non-contrastive conceptions. The first kind of argument for contrastivism is linguistic: the theory can make better sense of a range of knowledge ascriptions, including explicitly contrastive ascriptions (“Ann knows that it’s a zebra rather than an ostrich”), ascriptions involving intonational stress (“Ann knows that the zebra is in the pen”), and ascriptions with a wh-complement (“Ann knows where the zebra pen is”). All of these ascriptions are plausibly treated as making reference to a question under discussion, or set of alternatives.

A second kind of argument appeals to theoretical advantages of contrastivism. For example, contrastivism promises to provide a solution to puzzles that have haunted epistemology, like the closure paradox. Moore knows that he has hands, and knows that if he has hands, then he is not a brain in a vat. But Moore does not know that he is not a brain in a vat. How can this be? Well, Moore knows that he has hands rather than flippers, but he does not know that he has hands rather than that he is a brain in a vat. So according to the contrastivist, this seemingly intractable paradox actually relies on a fallacious equivocation: we cannot assume that because Moore knows that he has hands rather than flippers that he therefore knows that he has hands rather than that he’s a brain in a vat. One way to read the closure paradox is as a puzzle about knowledge ascriptions: why do we ascribe Moore knowledge that he has hands but not knowledge that he is not a brain in a vat? But there is also a nonlinguistic side to the puzzle: Moore’s knowledge that he has hands seems incompatible with his ignorance about whether he’s a brain in a vat, given a very plausible closure principle. This does not have anything directly to do with knowledge ascriptions (though obviously intuitions must be drawn out by presenting knowledge ascriptions). It rather points out something troubling about the concept of knowledge: either it does not apply where we think it does, or it does not obey the kind of logic we think it does. The contrastivist solution is to say that knowledge is a contrastive concept, so that the puzzling question is simply ill-conceived. Moore’s knowledge that he has hands is in fact not incompatible with his ignorance about whether he’s a brain in a vat. I call this a theoretical argument for contrastivism, rather than a linguistic one, because it involves showing how contrastivism can resolve paradoxes involving the concept of knowledge, not merely deliver attractive interpretations about a range of knowledge ascriptions.

There are other theoretical arguments for contrastivism about knowledge. First, the theory allows us to track inquiry (See Schaffer, 2005a). Inquiry involves answering questions and ruling out alternatives, and the contrast argument place lets us keep track of the question we are answering, and the alternatives we have ruled out. A further theoretical motivation for contrastivism about knowledge comes from the idea that the most important theoretical and practical function of knowledge is to identify good sources of information (see especially Craig, 1990; Schaffer, 2005a). The contrastivist can add to this claim the observation that when we are looking for good sources of information, we have a particular question in mind (though it may be a quite general question). A good informant for one question (for example, why is it raining rather than snowing?) may not be a good informant for a different question (for example, why is it raining rather than not precipitating at all?). So a contrastive concept of knowledge would best explain its primary function.

These arguments, like other theoretical arguments (for example, Morton, 2012) aim to show that contrastivism lets us best make sense of the theoretical, as well as practical, role of knowledge. The specifics of how these arguments go are less important for our purposes here; the important point is that there are two broad classes of arguments for contrastivism about some concept: (i) linguistic arguments and (ii) theoretical arguments. This pattern carries over to different domains, including ethics. The line between the two kinds of arguments will not be sharp. This is due in part to the fact, noted above, that often theoretical puzzles about some concept have to be drawn out by appealing to ascriptions of that concept. Though many of the clearest motivations for contrastivism do involve ascriptions of the target concept, it is nevertheless important to keep in mind that contrastivism is more than simply a linguistic thesis and has more than simply linguistic advantages.

A special case of contrastivism about knowledge—one that is especially relevant for this article—is Sinnott-Armstrong’s (2006) contrastive account of moral knowledge. Sinnott-Armstrong applies contrastivist ideas developed in his own earlier work and by contrastivists like Schaffer to moral epistemology. An interesting twist is that Sinnott-Armstrong uses contrastivism as a route to a kind of moral skepticism—the view that we do not have moral knowledge. Here is the basic idea: though many explicitly contrastive knowledge ascriptions, like “I know that it is morally wrong to terminate the pregnancy using non-sterilized equipment rather than to terminate the pregnancy using sterilized equipment”, may well be true, we should suspend judgment about the truth of non-contrastive ascriptions like “I know that it is morally wrong to terminate the pregnancy“. All knowledge ascriptions require some set of alternatives before they can be evaluated for truth. If one is not provided explicitly, Sinnott-Armstrong argues, we should understand the ascriptions as “I know that p out of the relevant contrast class”. And this is where the skeptical turn appears: Sinnott-Armstrong argues that we should be relevance skeptics—we should suspend judgment about what the relevant contrast class is. Hence, we cannot evaluate the truth of the unrelativized knowledge claims. This is not quite the dogmatic skeptical claim that we lack moral knowledge. Instead, this is a Pyrrhonian skeptical thesis: we should suspend judgment about the truth of unrelativized attributions of moral knowledge (and of knowledge more generally). Nevertheless, it is notable that other contrastivists appeal to contrastivism to resolve skeptical paradoxes, while Sinnott-Armstrong uses contrastivism in an argument for a kind of skepticism.

ii. Philosophy of Science

Contrastive theses have also been offered in the philosophy of science. Traditional theories of explanation hold that the explanatory relation holds between two relata: pEqp explains q. Contrastive theories of explanation hold that we need at least one, and possibly two, more argument places for contrasts. We may have pQEqp out of Q (or “rather than any other member of Q”) explains q; pEqQp explains q out of Q; or pQ1EqQ2p out of Q1 explains q out of Q2. Once again, there are both linguistic arguments and theoretical arguments for these contrastivist theories. For example, “The warm temperature explains why it is raining rather than snowing” may be true, while “The warm temperature explains why it is raining rather than not precipitating” may be false. (For more on contrastivism about explanation, see van Fraassen, 1980; Lipton, 1990 and Hitchcock, 1996.)

Relatedly, philosophers have offered contrastive theories of causation. Instead of holding that the causal relation is two place, eCfe causes f—contrastivists hold that we need at least one, and possibly two, more argument places. Either eQ1Cf, eCfQ2, or eQ1CfQ2. Contrastivism purports to solve several puzzles facing traditional non-contrastive theories of causation, including causation by absences and the puzzle of saying what the cause of some event is. (See, for example, Schaffer, 2005b, 2012;  and Hitchcock, 1996a, 1996b.)

Finally, philosophers have also offered contrastive theories of confirmation. According to this view, whether some evidence confirms a hypothesis depends on what we are comparing that hypothesis to. For example, the wet sidewalk confirms the hypothesis that it rained rather than that it was sunny all day, but does not confirm the hypothesis that it rained rather than that someone washed her bike on the sidewalk a few minutes ago. (See Chandler, 2007, 2013 and Fitelson, 2012 for discussion.)

b. Contrastivism and Questions

Contrastivists often claim that their theories are ones according to which the target concept is question-relative: relative to one question, the concept holds, while relative to another, it does not. For example, Schaffer (2005a, 2007a) argues that to know that p is to know that p as the answer to the contextually relevant question. So relative to a question like, “Is the bird a canary or a raven?”, you know that it is a canary—you know the answer to this question. But relative to the question, “Is the bird a canary or a goldfinch?”, you do not know that it is a canary—you do not know the answer to this second question.

Question-relativity is a natural idea for contrastivists. Questions—thought of as the informational contents of interrogative sentences, analogously to thinking of propositions as the informational contents of declarative sentences—are standardly treated as partitions over (some part of) logical space. These partitions divide logical space into cells, so that the possibilities are grouped in mutually exclusive classes. These partitions can also be thought of, then, as sets of mutually exclusive alternatives—each alternative in the set corresponds to one cell in the partition. Thus, relativizing a concept to questions simply amounts to relativizing it to sets of alternatives, which is exactly what the contrastivist wants to do. Different questions give us different partitions, and so correspond to different sets of alternatives.

To see this approach in action, return to the epistemological example. The question expressed by “Is the bird a canary or a raven?” is represented by the set of alternatives, {the bird is a canary, the bird is a raven}. Recall that this is a representation of a partition of (part of) logical space into two cells, one containing possibilities in which the bird is a canary and the other containing possibilities in which the bird is a raven. Similarly, the question expressed by “Is the bird a canary or a goldfinch?” is represented by the set of alternatives, {the bird is a canary, the bird is a goldfinch}. If we relativize knowledge to questions, then, we can explain why “You know the bird is a canary” is true when the relevant question is the first, but false when the relevant question is the second. For now, we will assume that in a given context, there is a relevant question which supplies the set of alternatives. In the section “Setting the Contrast Class” we will consider some problems for this assumption.

More directly relevant for ethics, contrastivists about normative concepts like “ought” and reasons have developed theories according to which these concepts are relativized to deliberative questions, or questions of what to do. In a given deliberative context—the kinds of context in which we ordinarily appeal to concepts like “ought” and reasons—there is some particular deliberative question we are trying to answer, since answering a deliberative question is just deciding what to do. This question supplies the set of alternatives relative to which claims about what we ought to do or have reason to do are interpreted.

c. Non-Exhaustivity and Resolution-Sensitivity

Thinking of a contrastive theory of some concept in terms of question-relativity helps bring out two important features of contrastivism. Both of these features are exploited by contrastivists.

First, questions may partition only part of, or some subspace of, logical space. Some possibilities may just not be relevant, for one reason for another, or may be ruled out by the presuppositions of the question. For example, if I ask which beer you want to try, possibilities in which you do not want to try any of the beers are plausibly not included. You can of course say that you do not want to try any beers, but this seems more like rejecting the question (admittedly in a conversationally cooperative way), rather than answering it—answering a question requires selecting one of the alternatives, or one cell of the partition. The relevance of this point for contrastivism is that the set of alternatives to which a concept is relativized may be non-exhaustive of logical space. This is most clear in the case of explicitly contrastive “rather than” ascriptions, like “You know that the bird is a canary rather than a raven”. Here, the contrastivist about knowledge will say that this sentence means that you know that the bird is a canary relative to the set {the bird is a canary, the bird is a raven}. Clearly there are many other possibilities—the bird could be a goldfinch, a crow, a robot made to look like a canary, or you could be dreaming. Relative to sets that include some of these other alternatives, you may not know that the bird is a canary. But since, on this view, knowledge claims are relativized to non-exhaustive sets of alternatives, it may still be true that you know that it is a canary relative to {the bird is a canary, the bird is a raven}.

Second, the possibilities that are partitioned can be grouped together in more or less fine-grained ways. Some distinctions between possibilities may be respected by the partition while others are smudged over. Compare the following two sets: {it’s a bird, it’s not a bird}, {it’s a canary, it’s a goldfinch, it’s a crow, it’s some other kind of bird, it’s a robot, it’s a hallucination, it’s some other kind of non-bird}. The second set makes distinctions between possibilities that are ignored in the first set. These sets differ in what Yalcin (2011) and Cariani (2013) call resolution: sets which make more fine-grained distinctions partition (parts of) logical space at a higher resolution. To say that some concept is resolution-sensitive, at least here, is to say that it is relativized to sets that may vary in resolution. Relative to a set at one resolution, the concept may hold of something, while relative to a set at a different resolution—either higher or lower—it may not.

2. Contrastivism in Ethics

While applications of contrastivism within epistemology and the philosophy of science are more well known, contrastivism has also been applied to a wide range of topics in ethics and normative philosophy more generally. We have already seen that contrastivist ideas have interesting applications in moral epistemology. This section introduces contrastivism about obligation, normative reasons, and freedom and moral responsibility. Having already introduced contrastivism more generally in the previous section, I will focus primarily on describing the specific motivations for the contrastive theories in ethics.

One application of contrastivist ideas in ethics that I will not discuss in detail is due to Driver (2012). Driver suggests a contrastive conception of luck, and makes use of this in her defense of a consequentialist treatment of moral luck. The central contrastivist claim is that no one, or no event, is lucky simpliciter. Rather, something is only lucky or unlucky relative to some contrasts. For example, a patient may be lucky to survive a serious illness rather than die from it, but not lucky to survive the serious illness, rather than not contract the illness in the first place.

a. Contrastivism about Obligation

The oldest application of contrastive ideas in ethics is contrastivism about obligation. Much of the work defending and developing contrastivism about obligation has focused primarily on developing contrastive semantic theories for the terms used to ascribe obligations, especially the deontic modal “ought”. This is not unexpected, since as we saw above, one important style of argument for contrastivism is linguistic in nature; contrastivism about obligation is no different. (Here I will conflate obligation and ought to stick more closely to the literature; the concept of obligation is better expressed using stronger deontic modals like “must” and “have to”.)

Contrastivism about obligation holds that what you ought to do can vary with the comparison being made. For example, though you ought to take the book back to the library rather than leave it on the shelf, it is not the case that you ought to take it back to the library rather than send it with me on my trip to the library.

It is important to distinguish the distinctive contrastivist claim from the much more widely accepted claim that what you ought to do depends on the available alternatives. If some option is the best one available, the non-contrastivist will say that it is what you ought to do. If circumstances change so that that option is no longer available, then obviously it is not the case that you ought to do it—it is not even an option. So what you ought to do has changed with the alternatives. But importantly, it has changed with the available alternatives. There is nothing surprising about this claim, and it is not the distinctive contrastivist claim. The distinctive contrastivist claim is that even holding the available alternatives fixed, what you ought to do can vary with the particular comparison. That is, claims about what you ought to do are only true or false relative to some particular set of alternatives, which may not include all of the available alternatives.

This puts us in a position to see one argument for contrastivism about obligation. Suppose that all of the following methods of getting to work are available: driving your SUV, taking the bus, riding your bike. The relevant factors here are environmental friendliness and getting some exercise. So riding your bike is best and driving your SUV is worst. The non-contrastivist will of course say that, in this case, you ought to ride your bike. And this is very plausible. But the following claim is also very plausible:

(1)   You ought to take the bus rather than drive your SUV.

But since taking the bus is not the best available alternative—riding your bike is also an available alternative—it is hard to see how the non-contrastivist can explain the truth of (1). The contrastivist, on the other hand, has an easy time explaining this. Out of the set of alternatives {take the bus, drive your SUV}, taking the bus is the best. And what you ought to do out of a set of alternatives is the best alternative in that set. So even if there are better available alternatives, we can still make true “ought” claims about suboptimal alternatives, as long as they are the best in the relevant set of alternatives; using a “rather than” claim as in (1) is one way of making a set the relevant one.

The non-contrastivist can of course try to reinterpret claims like (1) so that they do not require relativizing “ought” to sets of alternatives. For example, we may read (1) as saying something like, “If you are going to either take the bus or drive your SUV, you ought to take the bus”. One problem for this reply, as emphasized in an epistemic context by Schaffer (2008), is that this requires reading “rather than” as contributing some kind of conditional. But this is not a plausible general theory about the contribution of “rather than” clauses. It is much more linguistically plausible to treat “rather than” as making explicit the comparison being made, as the contrastivist does.

An even more important source of motivation for contrastivism about obligation comes from the puzzles of deontic logic, the logic of obligation. Many of these puzzles have the following form: acceptable “ought” claims lead, via plausible inference rules, to unacceptable “ought” claims. Here is just one example, called Ross’s Paradox, since it is originally due to Alf Ross (1941). Suppose you promise your friend that you will mail a letter for her. Then (2) is true:

(2)   You ought to mail the letter.

One inference rule that is validated by the standard semantics for “ought”, and by standard deontic logic, is the following:

Inheritance: If doing A entails doing B, then if you ought to do A, you ought to do B.

(This rule is usually stated treating “ought” as a propositional operator, read as “it ought to be that p”, instead of as (directly) ascribing an obligation, as in “you ought to A”. This goes beyond the scope of this article.) Besides being validated by orthodox treatments of “ought”, this inference rule has a lot of initial plausibility. One way to see this plausibility is to think of the special case in which doing B is a necessary means to doing A, and in that sense doing A entails doing B. If the only way to do something you ought to do requires doing B, then very plausibly, you thereby ought to do B. But inheritance leads to unacceptable results. Note that mailing the letter entails either mailing it or burning it, just because A entails (A or B), for any B. So from the acceptable “ought” claim (2), via Inheritance, (3) follows:

(3)   You ought to either mail the letter or burn it.

While (2) is acceptable, (3) is not. It ascribes an obligation to you, mailing the letter or burning it, that you can satisfy by burning the letter. But burning the letter is not a way to do anything you ought to do.

The standard reply to Ross’s Paradox is to accept the consequence, that (3) is true, but explain its apparent unacceptability pragmatically. The basic idea is that (3) is weaker than something else we are in a position to say, namely (2). This is to appeal to Grice’s (1989) maxim of quantity, that we should say the strongest thing we are in a position to say. Saying something weaker, like (3), suggests that we are not in a position to say something stronger, like (2). But in this case, we are in a position to say (2)—in fact, we derived (3) from (2). There have been various challenges to this line of reply; see in particular Cariani (2013).

The contrastivist offers a different solution. The outline of the solution is that the inference from (2) to (3) involves an illicit shift in the set of alternatives to which the “ought” claims are relativized—and hence is equivocal. To see why, remember that the alternatives in a set of alternatives must be mutually exclusive. Then notice that “mail the letter” and “mail the letter or burn it” are not mutually exclusive; so they cannot be members of the same set of alternatives. Thus, (2) and (3) cannot be relativized to the same set of alternatives. In an ordinary context, (2) would be relativized to a set like {mail the letter, leave the letter on the table, give the letter back to your friend, burn the letter}. (3), on the other hand, must be relativized to a set that includes “mail the letter or burn it” as an option, such as {mail the letter or burn it, leave the letter on the table, give the letter back to your friend}. In terms of our distinction between the non-exhaustivity of a set of alternatives, and the resolution of a set of alternatives, inferences like the one from (2) to (3) require a shift in resolution: the second set of alternatives lumps together two options—”mail the letter” and “burn the letter”—that are distinct in the first set. Since the contrastivist about obligation holds that obligation claims are sensitive to the resolution of the set of alternatives to which they are relativized, she can hold that the shift in resolution generates a shift in the truth of the obligation claim.

The first thing to see is that we simply cannot infer (3) from (2): to do so would be to equivocate, since the set of alternatives has shifted. It would be like inferring “Chris Paul is tall”, when he’s playing in a professional basketball game, from the truth of “Chris Paul is tall” when he’s at his family reunion (crucial background: Chris Paul is taller than most other members of his family, but shorter than most basketball players). The comparison class has shifted, and “tall” ascriptions are very plausibly relativized to comparison classes—to count as tall, you have to be taller than most members of the relevant comparison class.

The second thing to notice is that, not only can we not infer (3) from (2), we can also say that (3) is actually false. That is because, very plausibly, out of the set {mail the letter or burn it, leave the letter on the table, give the letter back to your friend}, it is not true that you ought to mail the letter or burn it—this is not the best option in the set.

This is the basic outline for one kind of contrastivist solution to puzzles of deontic logic. Cariani (2013) offers an interestingly different kind of contrastivist solution. Cariani takes up the task of blocking problematic inferences, such as Ross’s Paradox, while retaining intuitively acceptable ones that also seem to be supported by rules like inheritance.

b. Contrastivism and Freedom

Another implementation of contrastivist ideas in ethics is Sinnott-Armstrong’s (2012) contrastive account of freedom and moral responsibility. Central questions in this domain concern whether an agent’s act is free, and hence whether the agent is responsible for the act. Responsibility skeptics argue that since we can always trace the causal history of an act back to causes outside the agent, no one is ever responsible. Their opponents give various responses to this argument, including that freedom and responsibility do not require a lack of causation from outside the agent.

The first application of contrastivism is to what agents are free from. For example, an agent’s act may be free from external physical constraints (for example, chains or a shove) or internal compulsions (for example, addiction), but not free from all preceding causes (for example, the initial conditions of the universe). Such an act would be free rather than the result of a shove or addiction, but not free rather than caused (via a long chain) by the initial conditions of the universe. Adopting this contrastive conception of freedom helps clarify the dispute between responsibility skeptics and their opponents: the debate is over which kind of constraint is the relevant one for attributing responsibility. (Sinnott-Armstrong himself once again denies that there is any one relevant kind of constraint, and so does not take sides in the dispute between responsibility skeptics and their opponents.)

This contrastive picture also explains conflicting intuitions about whether a given act is free. Ordinarily, perhaps, we have in mind constraints like chains or addictions. Most acts in question in debates about freedom and responsibility are free, rather than being constrained by these kinds of things. But what the responsibility skeptic does, is to draw our attention to another kind of constraint—that of causes outside the agent. Actions are very plausibly not free, rather than being caused at all. If the contrastivist about freedom is right that freedom is a contrastive concept, and that both of these kinds of freedom—freedom from constraints and freedom from preceding causes—are legitimate, then this explains why we may be puzzled by questions about whether a given action is free.

The second application of contrastivism is to what agents are free to do. Sinnott-Armstrong’s illustrative example is of an alcoholic, Al. Suppose Al drinks some whisky at 8pm on Tuesday. We may ask whether this act was free. It seems to depend on the contrasts. Depending on how we specify the details of the case, all of the following may be true:

  1. Al’s drinking whisky rather than wine was free.
  2. Al’s drinking whisky at 8pm rather than at 9pm was free.
  3. Al’s drinking whisky rather than a non-alcoholic drink was not free.
  4. Al’s drinking whisky on Tuesday rather than waiting until Wednesday was not free.

As Sinnott-Armstrong sums up the point: “Addicts never have no control at all in any circumstances…most people are free to choose out of some contrast classes but not out of others.” (Sinnott-Armstrong, 2012:145). So the question of whether Al’s act was free is, for the contrastivist, incomplete. To say whether an action was free, we have to specify what the contrast is—relative to some contrasts, it may be free while relative to others it may not be. The important question then becomes which contrasts are relevant for which purposes. In particular, we can ask which contrasts are relevant for blaming and holding responsible. So contrastivism has helped us isolate the important questions in the debate about moral responsibility.

A related position is contrastivism about legal responsibility. Schaffer (2010) applies his contrastive account of causation (described in the section Philosophy of Science) to the notion of legal causation. If we accept that there is a close connection between the claim that someone caused, in the legally relevant sense, some outcome and the claim that she is legally responsible for that outcome, this contrastive account of causation in the law leads naturally to a contrastive theory of legal responsibility.

c. Contrastivism about Normative Reasons

The last application of contrastivism to ethics is contrastivism about normative reasons. A normative reason for an action is a consideration that counts in favor of performing that action. For example, the fact that you promised to return the book is a reason to return it, and the fact that you are causing me pain is a reason to get off of my foot. Many philosophers think reasons are central to ethics, and to normativity more generally. If that is correct, then contrastivism about normative reasons will likely have widespread implications throughout ethics.

As with most other implementations of contrastivism, contrastivism about reasons can be motivated by linguistic considerations:

  1. The fact that my guest is vegetarian is a reason to make vegetable lasagna rather than roast duck.
  2. The fact that my guest is vegetarian is not a reason to make vegetable lasagna rather than mushroom risotto.

Both of these contrastive claims are true. But now we might want to know, “Is the fact that my guest is vegetarian a reason to make vegetable lasagna or not?”. This is to ask whether this fact is a non-contrastive reason. This question is hard to answer. What this seems to show is that whether this fact is a reason or not depends on the alternatives—that it is a contrastive reason.

There are various ways for the non-contrastivist to respond to this argument. In particular, she may try to provide non-contrastive analyses of these contrastive claims. For example, we may appeal to the fact that reasons have strengths or weights, and hold that some consideration is a reason to do A rather than B when it is a stronger (non-contrastive) reason to do A than it is to do B. In this way, we can explain the truth of claims like (4) and (5) without adopting a contrastive view of reasons.

There are various problems with this kind of strategy. For just one, recall the similar strategy for dealing with contrastive obligation claims discussed in the section ”Contrastivism About Obligation”. The idea there was to say that the “rather than” in these claims should be analyzed out as a conditional. The problem was that this is not particularly linguistically plausible, since “rather than” does not ordinarily contribute a conditional. This strategy for dealing with contrastive reason claims faces a similar problem. “Rather than” does not ordinarily mean “stronger than”; instead, “rather than” should be understood as introducing contrasts.

Besides linguistic arguments, the second major kind of argument for contrastivism in some domain is theoretical. Recall that these kinds of arguments are not based primarily on contrastivism’s ability to give attractive interpretations of ascriptions of the target concept—in this case, reasons. Rather, they aim to show that given some theoretical role or property of the target the concept would be best explained by a contrastive view of the concept. A theoretical argument for contrastivism about reasons is that it best makes sense of the connection between reasons and the promotion of various objectives, like desires or values. A schematic statement of this very common idea is the following:

Promotion: Consideration R is a reason to perform act A if R explains why A-ing would promote objective O.

Again, an objective is some valuable thing to be promoted. Different theories will say different things: desire-based theories think reasons are tied to the promotion of the objects of desires, value-based theories think reasons are tied to the promotion of values like justice or goodness, and so on. No matter which of these theories we accept, we have to say what it takes for some action to promote an objective.

Snedegar (2014b) argues that the best way to do this is to adopt a contrastive picture. Relative to some contrasts an action may promote an objective, while relative to another, it may not. Suppose the relevant objective is contributing to the relief of hunger in the third world. This objective is not promoted by donating to an unreliable charity (they only get the money where it should go 20% of the time) rather than donating to a reliable charity. But it is promoted by donating to an unreliable charity rather than spending the money on an expensive dinner for myself. Hence, this objective gives me a reason to donate to the unreliable charity rather than spend the money on an expensive dinner, but does not give me a reason to donate to the unreliable charity rather than donate to the reliable charity. Non-contrastive views of promotion will deliver the verdict that this objective gives me no reason whatsoever to donate to the unreliable charity. So it is hard for them to explain the fact that it gives me a reason to donate to the unreliable charity rather than spending the money on an expensive dinner.

We have seen both linguistic and theoretical motivations for contrastivism about reasons. As we saw at the beginning of this section, reasons are often taken to be central to ethics and normativity more generally. So contrastivism about reasons is likely to have many upshots throughout ethics and normative philosophy. One nice thing about this is that it gives us a huge swathe of philosophy against which to test contrastivism about reasons: contrastivism may lead to exciting insights in normative philosophy, or it may lead to unacceptable results. Either way, this seems to be a fruitful area for research.

3. General Challenges

To close, consider some general challenges facing contrastivism of any variety. The specific form of these challenges, and the plausible responses, will likely vary from domain to domain. When it is necessary to apply the challenge to a concrete contrastivist theory, one from ethics will be chosen. As much as possible, however, the article remains at a general level, because it is instructive to think about the general shape of the challenges, as they face the contrastivist qua contrastivist.

a. Setting the Contrast Class

The first few challenges are interrelated, and have to do with setting the relevant contrast class. First, contrastivists face the challenge of saying what set of alternatives a given claim should be relativized to. For explicitly contrastive ascriptions of a concept, for example those using “rather than”, it is straightforward: the “rather than” clause makes the alternatives explicit. But for ascriptions that are not explicitly contrastive, the contrastivist has to provide some way of settling what the relevant set of alternatives is, or else admit that these unrelativized claims are not truth-evaluable, or at least that we should suspend judgment about their truth. To be satisfactory, this should be done in a relatively principled way. Otherwise, the contrastivist may face charges of fixing the contrasts in an ad hoc way to get the results she wants.

We have already seen one popular way to answer this challenge. This is to appeal to a question under discussion in the context. Linguists and philosophers of language have given arguments independent of contrastivism for the inclusion of such a device in our theory of communication. For example, it is useful in interpreting intonational stress (see Rooth, 1992) and in explaining several kinds of pragmatic phenomena (see Roberts, 2012). The contrastivist can exploit this: the question under discussion fixes the set of alternatives relative to which the ascription is interpreted.

But there are other options. Rather than appealing to a question under discussion, the contrastivist may instead appeal to the speaker’s intention, to features of the assessor’s context, or even to features of the subject (of the ascription) or her context. As we have already seen, one prominent contrastivist, Walter Sinnott-Armstrong, argues for a very different solution to the problem of determining the contrast class. Sinnott-Armstrong (2004, 2006) argues that no way of determining relevance is correct, and that we should instead be relevance skeptics. We should simply suspend judgment about the content and truth of non-relativized claims employing a contrastive concept. Sinnott-Armstrong’s arguments are challenging, and if the contrastivist wants to avoid his skepticism, she needs to grapple with them. One way to gain traction here, though this goes beyond the scope of this article, is to seek independent evidence for the existence of a relevant question under discussion in explanations of natural language phenomena. Linguists have developed powerful explanatory theories of various natural language phenomena using questions under discussion. So even if specific proposals about how to determine the relevant contrast class, or question under discussion, face challenges, we at least have some reason to be optimistic that there is such a relevant contrast class or question.

A second and related challenge is that contrastivism delivers apparently objectionable results, as long as the relevant contrast class is set up in the right way. This problem is perhaps sharpest for the contrastivist about obligation. You may be obligated to do all kinds of terrible or crazy things, because the contrast class is crazy. For example, the contrastivist about obligation will say that you are obligated to burn down your neighbor’s house while she is at work—as long as the relevant alternatives are worse than this. So you are obligated to burn down her house while she is at work rather than burn it down with her inside. This is even more objectionable when we remember that these need not be the only options open to you—it may be perfectly possible for you to take her a plate of freshly baked cookies, or to simply stay at home and watch television, instead. Still, the contrastivist will say that you are obligated to burn down her house while she is at work, as long as the relevant alternative is burning it down with her inside.

The contrastivist about obligation is committed to this result, when paired with any plausible theory about what an agent is obligated to do out of a given contrast class. But it is not clear how serious this problem actually is. The explicitly contrastive claim, “You are obligated to burn down her house while she’s at work rather than burn it down when she’s inside” is not obviously false. After all, burning it down while she’s at work is clearly better than burning it down while she’s inside. The bare, non-contrastive claim, “You are obligated to burn down her house while she’s at work” does sound obviously false. But the contrastivist is only committed to the truth of this claim when the only relevant alternatives are things like “burn it down while she’s inside” (or even worse alternatives). In any ordinary context—for example, a context in which you could take her a plate of freshly baked cookies, instead—these will not be the only relevant alternatives. In fact, they are unlikely to be relevant alternatives at all, at least before they are mentioned. In these ordinary contexts, the contrastivist about obligation will not be committed to the truth of the objectionable non-contrastive claim. The details of this solution will depend on what our theory tells us about fixing the relevant set of alternatives, but it should be clear that the contrastivist has options here.

A closely related problem is raised against contrastive theories of moral reasons by Andrew Jordan. Jordan argues that some actions should be, and are, performed in a whole-hearted way—that is, without considering alternatives at all. The virtuous person will simply see that taking her sick pet to the vet is the thing to do and will not consider alternatives, or take into account reasons for alternatives, for example, the potentially high cost. So the reasons favoring the whole-hearted action do not seem to be relativized to any contrast class at all.

This problem only arises if the contrastivist about reasons holds that the contrast class is fixed by the options the subject is considering. But as we have seen, there are many more options for the contrastivist. It is not clear, for example, how this problem could arise on a speaker contextualist theory. So this is not a problem for the contrastivist as such.

Though these last two challenges are not serious problems for contrastivism as such, they are useful in thinking about the first challenge—that of saying what fixes the contrast class for a given claim. The problem of crazy verdicts resulting from crazy contrast classes puts pressure on a very simple version of speaker contextualism, according to which the relevant contrast class is wholly fixed by the speaker’s intentions. As long as the speaker intends a crazy contrast class, the objectionable ascriptions may come out true. This kind of contrastivist would then need to try to explain why this result is not actually objectionable. Jordan’s problem of whole-hearted action puts pressure on a version of contrastivism according to which the relevant contrast class is wholly determined by what the agent is considering—if the virtuous agent is not considering any alternatives, then this version of contrastivism could not supply a contrast class.

Another problem in this vein is harder to articulate in a sharp way. It stems from the idea that there must be an answer to whether the concept really applies, over and above whether it applies relative to any particular set of alternatives. In the case of “ought”, for example, there is a feeling that there must be something that we really ought to do. We can imagine the objector saying, in an exasperated tone, “I know I ought to take the bus rather than drive my SUV. What I want to know is, ought I take the bus?”. Read straightforwardly, this objection is just a rejection of the central thesis of contrastivism. Read in that way, there is not much the contrastivist can say.

There is another, more contrastivist-friendly way to construe this idea. The idea may be that, though there are lots of true claims about when I ought to or have reason to perform some action rather than some other action, in certain kinds of deliberation and theorizing, we are interested in “oughts” and in reasons with some kind of special status. The contrastivist can accommodate this idea by identifying special contrast classes, and claiming that they are relevant in the cases the objector has in mind. Some good candidates include (i) a trivial contrast class, {A, ~A}, (ii) an exhaustive contrast class that includes every possibility open to the agent, (iii) a maximally fine-grained contrast class, and (iv) a contrast class that makes all morally relevant distinctions. These are not mutually exclusive options, of course—for example, all four could be construed as exhaustive sets of alternatives. The contrastivist can hold that some reasons or obligations, for example, moral reasons or obligations, are always relativized to one of these special kinds of contrast class, while other reasons and obligations are not. This is all perfectly consistent with contrastivism, and lets us capture something very close to the idea that there is something we really ought to do or really have reason to do.

b. Cross-Context Inferences

A very different kind of challenge involves cross-context inferences. The central feature of contrastivism, that lets it solve puzzles facing non-contrastive theories, is that a concept may apply relative to one set of alternatives without applying relative to others. For example, just because we know that you ought to A rather than B, that does not tell us anything about whether you ought to A rather than C. This central feature leads to a very important challenge: sometimes, knowing that a concept applies relative to some alternatives should tell us whether it applies relative to certain other alternatives. For example, if I know that I ought to A rather than either of B or C (out of {A, B, C}), our theory should guarantee that I ought to A rather than B (out of {A, B}). Similarly, if I ought to A rather than B and I ought to B rather than C, then our theory should guarantee that I ought to A rather than C.

The advantages of contrastivism come from letting the application of a concept vary with the alternatives. What this problem shows is that we have to constrain this variation in certain ways. The strategy adopted by contrastivists who have addressed this problem is to appeal to some non-contrastive foundation on which the application of the concept depends. For example, contrastivists about “ought” who have addressed this problem appeal to a contrast-invariant ranking of alternatives, and let the application of “ought” depend on this ranking in ways that deliver the necessary constraints.

4. Conclusion

Contrastivism has been applied across much of philosophy, and it is no wonder why. It promises to resolve the closure paradox in epistemology, provide the best theory of explanation, perhaps the central concept in philosophy and science, and finally give a true theory of causation. And that is before we even broach the field of ethics. There, contrastivism promises to resolve—or at least shed serious light on—the paradoxes of deontic logic, the problem of determinism, and provide an account of reasons for action. There is much more work to be done in making good on these promises. But at the very least, this appears to be a very fruitful research program—especially in ethics, where less work has been done.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Baumann, P. 2008. “Problems for Sinnott-Armstrong’s Moral Contrastivism.” The Philosophical Quarterly 58(232): 463-470.
    • Argues that contrastivism about knowledge makes bad predictions in cases of “crazy contrast classes”.
  • Blaauw, M. (ed.) 2012. Contrastivism in Philosophy. Routledge.
    • A collection of papers demonstrating the breadth of the contrastivist program in philosophy, including several in ethics.
  • Cariani, F. 2013. “Ought and Resolution Semantics.” Noûs 47(3): 534-558.
    •  Develops a sophisticated contrastive semantic theory for “ought”.
  •  Chandler, J. 2007. “Solving the Tacking Problem with Contrast Classes.” British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 58(3): 489-502.
    • Uses contrastive confirmation to solve an important problem in confirmation theory.
  • Chandler, J. 2013. “Contrastive Confirmation: Some Competing Accounts.” Synthese 190(1): 129-138.
  • Craig, W. 1990. Knowledge and the State of Nature: An Essay in Conceptual Synthesis. Oxford University Press.
    • Argues that the central function of the concept of knowledge is to identify good sources of information, and develops a theory of knowledge based on this conception.
  •  Dretske, F. 1970. “Epistemic Operators.” Journal of Philosophy 67: 1007-1023.
    • Early version of the relevant alternatives theory of knowledge, direct predecessor of contrastivism.
  • Driver, J. 2012. “Luck and Fortune in Moral Evaluation.” In Blaauw (ed.), Contrastivism in Philosophy. Routledge, 154-172.
    • Sketches a contrastive account of luck, and applies it to the problem of moral luck.
  • Finlay, S. 2009. “Oughts and Ends.” Philosophical Studies 143(3): 315-340.
  • Finlay, S. 2014. Confusion of Tongues: A Theory of Normative Language. Oxford University Press.
    • Develops a theory of “ought” which makes use of contrastivist machinery in the service of providing a comprehensive theory of normativity.
  • Finlay, S. and Snedegar, J. 2014. “One Ought Too Many.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 89(1): 102-124.
    • Defends a uniform, propositional operator semantics for “ought”, making crucial use of contrastivism.
  • Fitelson, B. 2012. “Contrastive Bayesianism.” In Blaauw (ed.), Contrastivism in Philosophy. Routledge, 64-87.
    • Discussion of contrastive theories of confirmation.
  • van Fraassen, B. 1980. The Scientific Image. Oxford University Press.
    • Influential development of a contrastive theory of explanation.
  • Grice, H. P. 1989. “Logic and Conversation.” In Grice, Studies in the Way of Words. Harvard University Press, 22-40.
    • Classic discussion of conversational implicature, where speakers communicate more than they literally say.
  • Groenendijk, J. and Stokhof, M. 1997. “Questions.” In van Benthem, J. and ter Meulen, A. (eds.), Handbook of Logic and Language. Elsevier Science Publishers, 1055-1124.
    • Detailed discussion of the semantics of questions, including the partition/set of alternatives semantics.
  • Hamblin, C. L. 1958. “Questions.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 36: 159-168.
    • Early development of the partition semantics for questions.
  • Higginbotham, J. 1996. “The Semantics of Questions.” In Lappin, S. (ed.), The Handbook of Contemporary Semantic Theory. Oxford University Press, 361-383.
  • Hitchcock, C. 1996a. “The Role of Contrast in Causal and Explanatory Claims.” Synthese 107: 395-419.
  • Hitchcock, C. 1996b. “Farewell to Binary Causation.” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 26: 267-282.
    • Development of a contrastive theory of causation.
  • Jackson, F. 1985. “On the Semantics and Logic of Obligation.” Mind 94(374): 177-195.
    • Development of a contrastive theory of obligation, motivated by puzzles from deontic logic.
  • Jackson, F. and Pargetter, R. 1986. “Oughts, Options, and Actualism.” Philosophical Review 95(2): 233-255.
    • Development of a contrastive theory of obligation.
  • Jordan, A. 2014. "Whole-Hearted Motivation and Relevant Alternatives: A Problem for the Contrastivist Account of Moral Reasons." Ethical Theory and Moral Practice 17(5): 835-845.
  • Karjalainen, A. and Morton, A. 2003. “Contrastive Knowledge.” Philosophical Explorations 6(2): 74-89.
    • Argues for a contrastive conception of knowledge.
  • Lewis, D. 1996. “Elusive Knowledge.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74: 549-567.
    • Influential development of the relevant alternatives theory of knowledge, a direct predecessor of contrastivism about knowledge.
  • Lipton, P. 1990. “Contrastive Explanation.” Royal Institute for Philosophy Supplement 27: 247-266.
    • Development of a contrastive theory of explanation.
  • McNamara, P. 2014. “Deontic Logic.” In Zalta (ed.), Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • Detailed overview of deontic logic, including the puzzles that motivate contrastivism about obligation.
  • Morton, A. 2012. “Contrastive Knowledge.” In Blaauw (ed.), Contrastivism in Philosophy. Routledge, 101-115.
    • Gives primarily theoretical, rather than linguistic, arguments for contrastivism about knowledge.
  • Roberts, C. 2012. “Information Structure in Discourse: Towards an Integrated Formal Theory of Pragmatics.” Semantics and Pragmatics 5: 1-69.
    • Detailed development of a formal pragmatic theory making crucial use of questions under discussion.
  • Rooth, M. 1992. “A Theory of Focus Interpretation.” Natural Language Semantics 1: 75-116.
    • Develops a theory for interpreting focus (for example, intonational stress) in natural language, making crucial use of sets of alternatives.
  • Ross, J. 2009. Acceptance and Practical Reason. PhD Thesis, Rutgers University, Chapter 9.
    • Gives arguments for a contrastive treatment of normative reasons.
  • Schaffer, J. 2004. “From Contextualism to Contrastivism.” Philosophical Studies 119(1-2): 73-104.
    • Argues that contrastivism about knowledge is superior to standard forms of contextualism.
  • Schaffer, J. 2005a. “Contrastive Knowledge.” In Gendler and Hawthorne (eds.), Oxford Studies in Epistemology, Vol. 1. Oxford University Press, 235-271.
    • Argues for and develops a contrastive theory of knowledge.
  • Schaffer, J. 2005b. ‘Contrastive Causation.’ The Philosophical Review 114: 327-358.
    • Argues for and develops a contrastive theory of causation.
  • Schaffer, J. 2007a. “Knowing the Answer.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 75(2): 383-403.
    • Argues for and develops a contrastive theory of knowledge, based primarily on knowledge-wh ascriptions—for example, “knows who”, “knows whether”.
  • Schaffer, J. 2007b. “Closure, Contrast, and Answer.” Philosophical Studies 133(2): 233-255.
    • Shows how a contrastivist about knowledge can explain inferences supported by closure principles, even though the contrastivist has to reject standard closure principles.
  • Schaffer, J. 2008. “The Contrast-Sensitivity of Knowledge Ascriptions.” Social Epistemology 22(3): 235-245.
    • Argues against non-contrastivist treatments of the linguistic data used to motivate contrastivism.
  • Schaffer, J. 2010. “Contrastive Causation in the Law.” Legal Theory 16: 259-297.
    • Applies contrastivism about causation to causation as appealed to in judgments of legal responsibility.
  • Schaffer, J. 2012. “Causal Contextualisms.” In Blaauw (ed.), Contrastivism in Philosophy. Routledge, 35-63.
    • Discussion of contrastivism about causation, with a somewhat pessimistic conclusion for its ultimate prospects.
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, W. 2004. “Classy Pyrrhonism.” In W. Sinnott-Armstrong (ed.), Pyrrhonian Skepticism. Oxford University Press, 188-207.
    • Argues for contrastivism about knowledge, but uses this theory to support Pyrrhonian skepticism about unrelativized knowledge claims by arguing for skepticism about the notion of a “relevant” contrast class.
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, W. 2006. Moral Skepticisms. Oxford University Press.
    • Applies the ideas in Sinnott-Armstrong (2004) to moral epistemology.
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, W. 2008a. “A Contrastivist Manifesto.” Social Epistemology 22(3): 257-270.
    • An overview of contrastivism across philosophy.
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, W. 2008b. “Replies to Hough, Baumann, and Blaauw.” Philosophical Quarterly 58(232): 478-488.
    • Replies to Baumann’s (2008) “crazy contrast class” objection to contrastivism about knowledge.
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, W. 2012. “Free Contrastivism.” In Blaauw (ed.), Contrastivism in Philosophy. Routledge, 134-153.
    • Shows how a contrastive account of freedom can clarify disputes in discussions of determinism and moral responsibility.
  • Sloman, A. 1970. “Ought and Better.” Mind 79(315): 385-394.
    • Early development of a contrastive view of obligation.
  • Snedegar, J. 2012. “Contrastive Semantics for Deontic Modals.” In Blaauw (ed.), Contrastivism in Philosophy. Routledge, 116-133.
    • Argues for a contrastive treatment of deontic modals like “ought”, “must”, and “may”.
  • Snedegar, J. 2013a. “Negative Reason Existentials.” Thought 2(2): 108-116.
    • Shows how to use contrastivism to solve a puzzle about claims like “There’s no reason to cry over spilled milk.”
  • Snedegar, J. 2013b. “Reason Claims and Contrastivism about Reasons.” Philosophical Studies 166(2): 231-242.
    • Argues for contrastivism about normative reasons on the basis of reason claims employing “rather than”.
  • Snedegar, J. 2014a. “Deontic Reasoning across Contexts.” In F. Cariani, and others (eds.), Deontic Logic and Normative Systems, Vol. 12, Springer Lecture Notes in Computer Science, 2014a: 208-223.
    • Shows how a contrastivist about obligation can recapture intuitive inferences supported by inference rules the contrastivist rejects.
  • Snedegar, J. 2014b. “Contrastive Reasons and Promotion.” Ethics 125 (2014b): 39-63.
    • Argues for and develops a version of contrastivism, based on the idea that normative reasons are tied to the promotion of objectives.
  • Yalcin, S. 2011. “Nonfactualism about Epistemic Modality.” In Egan, A. and Weatherson, B. (eds.), Epistemic Modality. Oxford University Press, 295-332.
    • Introduces the idea of resolution-sensitivity in a discussion of epistemic modality.


Author Information

Justin Snedegar
University of St Andrews
United Kingdom

The Moral Permissibility of Punishment

The legal institution of punishment presents a distinctive moral challenge because it involves a state’s infliction of intentionally harsh, or burdensome, treatment on some of its members—treatment that typically would be considered morally impermissible. Most of us would agree, for instance, that it is typically impermissible to imprison people, to force them to pay monetary sanctions or engage in community service, or to execute them. The moral challenge of punishment, then, is to establish what (if anything) makes it permissible to subject those who have been convicted of crimes to such treatment.

Traditionally, justifications of punishment have been either consequentialist or retributivist. Consequentialist accounts contend that punishment is justified as a means to securing some valuable end—typically crime reduction, by deterring, incapacitating, or reforming offenders. Retributivism, by contrast, holds that punishment is an intrinsically appropriate (because deserved) response to criminal wrongdoing. Each type of account has been roundly criticized, on a variety of grounds, by theorists in the other camp. In an effort to break this impasse, scholars have attempted to find alternative strategies that incorporate certain consequentialist or retributivist elements but avoid the standard objections directed at each. Each of these accounts has, in turn, met with criticism. Finally, abolitionists argue that none of these defenses of punishment is satisfactory, and that the practice is morally impermissible; the salient question for abolitionists, then, is how else (if at all) society should respond to those forms of wrongdoing that we now punish.

This article first looks more closely at what punishment is; in particular, it examines the distinctive features of punishment in virtue of which it stands in need of justification. It then highlights various questions that a full justification of punishment would need to answer. With these questions in mind, the article considers the most prominent consequentialist, retributivist, and hybrid attempts at establishing punishment’s moral permissibility. Finally, it considers the abolitionist alternative.

Table of Contents

  1. What is Punishment?
  2. Various Questions
  3. Consequentialist Accounts
    1. Deterrence
    2. Incapacitation
    3. Offender Reform
    4. Sentencing
    5. Objections and Responses
  4. Retributivist Accounts
    1. Deserved Suffering
    2. Fair Play
    3. Censure
    4. Other Versions
    5. Sentencing
  5. Alternative Accounts
    1. Rights Forfeiture
    2. Consent
    3. Self-Defense
    4. Moral Education
    5. Hybrid Approaches
  6. Abolitionism
  7. References and Further Reading

1. What is Punishment?

When we consider whether punishment is morally permissible, it is important first to be clear about what it is that we are evaluating. Theorists disagree about a precise definition of punishment; nevertheless, we can identify a number of features that are commonly cited as elements of punishment.

First, it is generally accepted that punishment involves the infliction of a burden. The state confines people in jails and prisons, where liberties such as their freedom of movement and association, and their privacy, are heavily restricted. It imposes often heavy monetary sanctions or forces people to take part in community service work. It subjects people to periods of probation during which their movements and activities are closely supervised. In the most extreme cases, it executes people. Theorists disagree on precisely how to characterize this feature of punishment. Some describe punishment as essentially painful, or as involving the infliction of suffering, harsh treatment, or harm. Others instead write of punishment as involving the restriction of liberties. However we characterize the specific nature of the burden, it is relatively uncontroversial that punishment in its various forms is burdensome.

One might object that some prisoners could become accustomed to incarceration and so not see it as a burden, or that the masochist might even enjoy his corporal punishment. In response to supposed counterexamples such as these, a defender of the “burdensomeness” feature of punishment might argue that the comfortable prisoner and the masochist are still punished insofar as they are treated in ways that are typically regarded as burdensome by those on whom they are inflicted. Alternatively, one might argue that a particular case of incarceration, corporal punishment, and so forth, indeed does not count as punishment if the prisoner does not find it burdensome (Boonin, 2008: 8-10). Whatever one makes of these attempted counterexamples, it remains the case that punishment theorists by and large agree that burdensomeness is an essential feature of punishment.

But punishment is not merely burdensome. A second widely accepted feature of punishment is that it is intended to be burdensome. This feature distinguishes punishment from other forms of treatment that may be burdensome but are not intentionally so. Many people undoubtedly regard it as burdensome to pay their taxes, for instance, but presumably most do not regard this as a form of punishment. This is because although taxes may be foreseeably burdensome, they are not intentionally so. That is, the state does not levy taxes intending for them to be burdensome; rather, the intention is to pay for roads, an education system, and other public goods. That paying for these goods is burdensome to many taxpayers is incidental, and if there were a way to collect sufficient revenue to pay for needed public goods without this being a burden to taxpayers, then so much the better.

Punishment, however, is different. Punishment is intended to be burdensome. If it were not burdensome, then it would not be doing its job. For instance, as we will see below, some theorists contend that the aim of punishment is to reduce crime by deterring potential criminals. But for the threat of punishment to be the sort of thing likely to deter criminals, the punishment itself must be burdensome. Other theorists (retributivists) contend that wrongdoers deserve to suffer, and that punishment is justified as the infliction of this deserved suffering. Here again, the burdensomeness of punishment is not merely incidental, it is intended.

Of course, not all impositions of intended burdens count as punishment. A third commonly accepted feature of punishment is that it is imposed on someone guilty of an offense, as a response to that offense. Actually, there is some disagreement about this point. To count as punishment, must it be imposed on someone who is actually guilty of a crime? Or would it make sense to talk of punishing an innocent person (either mistakenly or intentionally)? Some scholars contend that punishment must be of a guilty person. Susan Dimock writes, “The innocent may be ‘victimized’ by the penal system, but they cannot be ‘punished’” (Dimock, 1997: 42). By contrast, H. L. A. Hart contends that we should acknowledge not only punishment of actual offenders, but also cases (which he calls “sub-standard or secondary”) of punishment “of persons…who neither are in fact nor supposed to be offenders” (see Hart, 1968: 5).

A fourth feature of punishment, widely acknowledged at least since the publication of Joel Feinberg’s seminal 1970 article “The Expressive Function of Punishment” is that it serves to express condemnation, or censure, of the offender for her offense. As Feinberg discusses, it is this condemning element that distinguishes punishment from what he calls “nonpunitive penalties” such as parking tickets, demotions, flunkings, and so forth. (Feinberg, 1965: 398-401). As we will see below, some scholars have taken this expression of censure to be central to the justification of punishment. But whether or not it plays a role in the justification of the practice, this expressive function is typically accepted as a distinctive feature of punishment.

Finally, it is worth highlighting that this article focuses on the legal institution of punishment—rather than, say, parents’ punishment of their children or other interpersonal cases of punishment (but see Zaibert, 2006). Legal theorists often assert as one of punishment’s features that it must be imposed by a properly constituted legal authority (typically, the state). They thereby aim to differentiate legal punishment from private vengeance or vigilantism. This does not mean we must accept uncritically that the state is the proper authority to impose punishment. Ideally, a full account of punishment should provide a plausible answer to why (or if) the state has an exclusive right to impose punishment.

These, then, are the most commonly cited features of punishment: punishment involves the state’s imposition of intended burdens—burdens that express social condemnation—on people (believed to be) guilty of crimes, in response to those crimes. This is not intended as a precise definition or a set of necessary and sufficient conditions for punishment. Theorists may disagree about particular elements, or especially about how exactly to flesh out the various elements. But this description is sufficient to give us a sense of why punishment stands in need of justification: It involves the state’s treating some of its members (imposing intentionally burdensome, censuring sanctions) in ways that typically would be morally impermissible.

2. Various Questions

When theorists ask whether punishment is justified, they typically assume a backdrop in which the legal system administering punishment is legitimate, and the criminal laws themselves are reasonably just. This is not to say that they assume that all legal systems are legitimate and all criminal laws are reasonably just in the actual world. Indeed, questions of political legitimacy and criminalization are important topics that have received a great deal of attention in their own right. But even in societies in which the legal system is legitimate and the laws are reasonably just, a general question arises of whether (and if so, why) it is permissible for the state to impose intended, censuring burdens on those who violate the laws.

This general question of punishment’s moral permissibility actually comprises a number of particular questions. A full normative account of punishment should provide answers to each of these questions.

First, there is the question of punishment’s function, or purpose. Put simply, what reason is there to want an institution of punishment? H. L. A. Hart referred to this as punishment’s “general justifying aim,” although this term may be misleading in two ways: on one hand, to say that the aim is justifying implies that it is sufficient, by itself, to establish punishment’s permissibility. As we will see, some scholars point out that more is needed to justify punishment than merely citing its function, no matter how valuable. On the other hand, talk of a justifying aim seems to privilege consequentialist accounts, according to which punishment is justified as a means to some socially valuable goal. But even for retributivist accounts, according to which punishment is justified not as a means to some end but rather as an intrinsically appropriate response to wrongdoing, we still need an explanation of why such a response is important enough to warrant the state’s institution of punishment. A first question, then, is what sufficiently important function punishment serves.

Even if we establish some sufficiently valuable function of punishment, this may not be enough to justify the practice. Some scholars contend that a crucial question is whether punishment violates the moral rights of those punished. If punishing offenders violates their rights, then it may be morally impermissible even if it serves some important function (Simmons, 1991; Wellman, 2009). What we need, according to this view, is an account of why, in principle, the practice of imposing intended burdens on people in the ways characteristic of punishment does not violate their moral rights.

In addition to justifying the practice of punishment in general, a complete account of punishment should also provide guidance in determining how to punish in particular cases. Even if the institution of punishment is morally permissible, a particular sentence may be impermissible if it is excessively harsh (or on some accounts, if it is too lenient). What principles and considerations should guide assessments of how severely to punish?

Relatedly, although this point has received less attention, we should ask not only about the appropriate severity of punishment but also about the proper mode of punishment. We may critique certain sentences not in virtue of their severity but because we believe the form of punishment (incarceration, capital punishment, and so forth) is in some sense inappropriate (Reiman, 1985; Moskos, 2011). What considerations, then, should guide assessments of whether imprisonment, fines, community service, probation, capital punishment, or some other form of punishment is the appropriate response to instances of criminal wrongdoing?

Finally, as mentioned, it is important to ask about the state’s role as the agent of punishment. Why is it the state’s right to impose punishment (if indeed it is)? Furthermore, what gives the state the exclusive right to punish (Wellman, 2009)? Why may victims not inflict punishment on their assailants (or hire someone to inflict the punishment)? Another question related to the proper agent of punishment—a question that has become increasingly salient in the decades following the Nuremberg trials—is when (if ever) the international community, rather than a particular state, can be the proper agent of punishment. What sorts of crime, and which criminals, are properly accountable to the institutions of international criminal law rather than (or perhaps in addition) to the domestic legal systems of particular states?

As we will see, various accounts of punishment focus on different questions. Also, some accounts seek to answer each of these questions by appealing to the same moral principles or considerations, whereas others appeal to different considerations in answering the different questions.

3. Consequentialist Accounts

Consequentialism holds that the rightness or wrongness of actions—or rules for action, or (relevant to our context) institutions—is determined solely by their consequences. Thus consequentialist accounts of punishment defend the practice as instrumentally valuable: the consequences of maintaining an institution of legal punishment, according to this view, are better than the consequences of not having such an institution. For many consequentialists, the burden of punishment itself is seen as a negative consequence—an “evil,” as Jeremy Bentham called it (Bentham, 1789: 158). Thus for punishment to be justified, it must be the case that it brings about other, sufficiently valuable consequences to outweigh its onerousness for the person on whom it is inflicted. Typically, punishment is defended as a necessary means to the socially valuable end of crime reduction, through deterrence, incapacitation, or offender reform.

a. Deterrence

Deterrence accounts contend that the threat of punishment serves as a disincentive for potential criminals. On such accounts, for the threat of punishment to be effective as a deterrent, it must be credible—it must have teeth, so to speak—and thus the legal system must follow through on the threat and impose punishment on those who violate laws. Theorists have distinguished two potential audiences for the deterrent threat: first, the threat of punishment might serve to dissuade members of the public generally from committing crimes that they might otherwise have committed. This is called general deterrence. Second, for those who do commit crimes and are subjected to punishment, the threat of future punishment (namely, the prospect of having to experience prison again, or pay further fines, and so forth) might provide a disincentive to reoffending. This is typically referred to as specific (or special) deterrence.

b. Incapacitation

Punishment might also help to reduce crime by incapacitating criminals. Unlike deterrence, incapacitation does not operate by dissuading potential offenders. Incapacitation instead aims to remove dangerous people from situations in which they could commit crimes. Imprisoning someone in a solitary confinement unit, for instance, may or may not convince her not to commit crimes in the future; but while she is locked up, she will be unable to commit (most) crimes.

c. Offender Reform

A third way in which punishment might help to reduce crime is by encouraging or facilitating offender reform. The aim of reform is like that of specific deterrence in one respect: both seek to induce a change in the offender’s behavior. That is, the aim for both is that she should choose not to reoffend. In this respect, both reform and specific deterrence differ from incapacitation, which is concerned with restricting rather than influencing offenders’ choices. But reform differs from specific deterrence in terms of the ways in which each seeks to induce different choices. Punishment aimed at specific deterrence provides prudential reasons: we impose onerous treatment on an offender in hopes that her aversion to undergoing such treatment again will convince her not to reoffend. Punishment with the aim of offender reform, by contrast, aims to reshape offenders’ moral motives and dispositions.

d. Sentencing

Each of these aims—deterrence, incapacitation, and reform—will have distinct implications with respect to sentencing. Punishment aimed at reducing crime through deterrence would in general need to be severe enough to provide members of the public with a significant incentive not to offend, or to provide offenders with an incentive not to reoffend. Also, as Bentham explained, the severity of sentences should reflect the relative seriousness of the crimes punished (Bentham, 1789: 168). More serious crimes should receive more severe punishments than do less serious crimes, so that prospective offenders, if they are going to commit one crime or the other, will have an incentive to choose the less serious crime.

For punishment aimed at reducing crime through incapacitation, sentences should be restrictive enough that dangerous offenders will be unable to victimize others (so, for instance, prison appears generally preferable to fines as a form of incapacitative punishment). In terms of duration, incapacitative sentences should last as long as the offender poses a genuine threat. Similarly, sentences aimed at reducing crime through offender reform should be tailored, in terms of the form, severity, and duration of punishment, in whatever ways are determined to be most conducive to this aim.

Finally, insofar as punishment itself is considered to be, in Bentham’s words, an “evil,” the consequentialist is committed to the view that sentences should be no more severe than is necessary to accomplish their aim. Thus whether she endorses deterrence, incapacitation, reform, or some other aim (or a combination of these), the consequentialist should also endorse a parsimony constraint on sentence severity (Tonry, 2011). After all, to impose sentences that are more severe than is necessary to accomplish punishment’s aim(s) would appear to be an infliction of gratuitous suffering—and so, from a consequentialist perspective, unjustified.

e. Objections and Responses

Typical consequentialist accounts of punishment contend that the practice is justified because it produces, on balance, positive consequences by helping to reduce crime, either through deterrence, incapacitation, or offender reform. Critics have objected to such consequentialist accounts on a number of grounds.

First, some have objected to deterrence accounts on grounds that punishment does not actually deter potential offenders. A key worry is that often (perhaps typically) those who commit crimes act impulsively or irrationally, rather than as efficient calculators of expected utility, and so they are not responsive to the threat of punishment. The question of whether punishment deters is an empirical one, and criminological studies on this question have come to different conclusions. In general, evidence seems to indicate that punishment does have some deterrent effect, but that the certainty of apprehension plays a greater deterrent role than does the severity of punishment (Nagin, 2013).

A similar line of objection has been raised against reform-based accounts of punishment. Criminological research in the 1970s led many scholars and practitioners to conclude that punishment did not, indeed could not, promote offender reform (the mantra “nothing works” was for many years ubiquitous in these discussions). More recent criminological work, however, has generated somewhat more optimism about the prospects for offender reform (Cullen, 2013).

Whereas critics have questioned whether punishment deters or facilitates offender reform, there is little doubt that punishment—especially incarceration—incapacitates (prisoners may still have opportunities to commit crimes, but their opportunities are at least significantly limited.) Critics have raised questions, however, about the link between incapacitation and crime reduction. For punishment to be justified on incapacitative grounds, after all, it would need to be the case not only that punishment in fact incapacitates, but that in so doing it helps to reduce crime. At least in some cases, there is reason to doubt whether the link between incapacitation and crime reduction holds. Most notably, locking up drug dealers or gang members does not appear to decrease drug- or gang-related crimes, because the incapacitated person is quickly and easily replaced by someone else (Tonry, 2006: 31-32).

Even if we accept, for argument’s sake, that punishment contributes to crime reduction, it still may not be justified on consequentialist grounds if it also generates costs that outweigh its benefits. The costs of punishment are not limited to the suffering or other burdens inflicted on offenders, although these burdens do matter from a consequentialist perspective. Scholars have also highlighted burdens associated with certain forms of punishment—in particular, incarceration—for offenders’ families and communities (Mauer and Chesney-Lind, 2002). These costs matter in consequentialist calculations. In addition, we must consider the financial costs of maintaining an institution of criminal punishment. In 2012, the Vera Institute of Justice released a study of 40 U.S. states that found that the total taxpayer cost of prisons in these states was $39 billion. Thus defenders of punishment on consequentialist grounds must show not only that punishment is beneficial, but also that its benefits are significant enough to outweigh its costs to offenders and to society generally.

Furthermore, even if punishment’s benefits outweigh its costs, consequentialists must make the case that these benefits cannot be achieved through some other, less burdensome response to crime. If there are alternatives to punishment that are equally effective in reducing crime but are less costly overall, then from a consequentialist perspective, these alternatives would be preferable (Boonin, 2008: 53, 264-67).

Suppose, however, that the benefits of punishment outweigh its harms and also that there are no alternatives to punishment that generate, on balance, better overall consequences. In this case, punishment would be justified from a consequentialist perspective. Many theorists, however, do not endorse consequentialism. Indeed, the most prominent philosophical objections to consequentialist accounts of punishment take aim specifically at supposed deficiencies of consequentialism itself.

Perhaps the most common objection to consequentialist accounts is that they are unable to provide principled grounds for ruling out punishment of the innocent. If there were ever a situation in which punishing an innocent person would promote the best consequences, then consequentialism appears committed to doing so. H. J. McCloskey imagines a case in which, in the wake of a heinous crime, a small-town sheriff must decide whether to frame and punish a person whom the townspeople believe to be guilty but the sheriff knows is innocent if doing so is the only way to prevent rioting by the townspeople (McCloskey, 1957: 468-69). If punishing the innocent person defuses the residents’ hostilities and prevents the riots—and thereby produces better overall consequences than continuing to search for the actual criminal—then it appears that the consequentialist is committed to punishing the innocent person. But knowingly punishing an innocent person strikes most of us as deeply unjust.

Consequentialists have responded to this objection in various ways. Some contend that what McCloskey describes is not actually punishment, because punishment, by definition, is a response to those guilty of crimes (or at least believed to be guilty, whereas in McCloskey’s example, the sheriff knows the person to be innocent). H. L. A. Hart refers to this response as the “definitional stop” and he suggests it is unhelpful because it seeks to define away the interesting normative questions. Setting terminology aside, the relevant questions are whether and why it is permissible to impose intended, condemnatory burdens on those (believed to be) guilty of crimes. The consequentialist’s response is that doing so produces the best consequences, but then it seems that the consequentialist should be committed to imposing such burdens on those not (believed to be) guilty of crimes when doing so produces the best consequences. Such a practice would strike many as morally wrong, however. Thus the objection arises for consequentialists regardless of definitions.

Others have responded to the objection that consequentialism would allow for punishing the innocent by suggesting that scenarios such as McCloskey suggests are so far-fetched that they are unlikely to occur in the real world. In actual cases, punishing the innocent will rarely, if ever, produce the best consequences. For instance, some contend that the sheriff in the example would likely be found out, and as a result the public would lose its trust in law enforcement officials; the long-term consequences, therefore, would be worse than if the sheriff had not punished the innocent person. As critics have pointed out, however, this response only shows that punishing the innocent will usually be ruled out by consequentialism. There might still be cases, albeit rare, in which punishing the innocent would generate the best consequences (maybe the sheriff is adept at covering up his act). At best, then, consequentialism seems only able to ground a contingent prohibition on punishing the innocent. Some consequentialists have accepted this implication, albeit reluctantly (see Smart, 1973: 69-73).

A similar objection to consequentialist accounts is that they cannot provide a principled basis for the widely held intuition that punishment should be no more severe than an offender deserves (where desert is the product of the seriousness of the offense and the offender’s culpability). On this view, it is morally wrong to subject those guilty of relatively minor crimes to harsh punishment; such punishment would be excessive. For consequentialist accounts, though, it appears that excessively harsh sentences would be permitted (indeed, required) if they produced the best overall consequences.

Jeremy Bentham contended that consequentialism does have the resources to ground relative proportionality in sentencing—that is, lesser offenses should receive less severe sentences than more serious offenses receive. His reasoning was that if sentences for minor offenses were as harsh as for more serious offenses, potential offenders would have no incentive to commit the lesser offense rather than the more serious one (Bentham, 1789: 168). If Bentham is right, then there is a consequentialist basis for punishing shoplifters, for instance, less harshly than armed robbers. But this does not rule out punishing shoplifters harshly (more harshly than most of us would think justified) and punishing armed robbers even more harshly; again, a consequentialist would seem committed to such a sentencing scheme if it promoted the best overall consequences.

Defenders of consequentialist sentencing have another response available, namely that excessively harsh sentences do not, in practice, produce the best consequences. For instance, criminological research suggests a) that stiffer sentences do not produce significant deterrent effects (it is primarily the certainty of punishment rather than its severity that deters); b) that extremely long prison terms are not justified on incapacitative grounds (for one reason, most offenders “age out” of criminal behavior anyway by their 30s or 40s); and c) that extremely harsh sentences may, on balance, have criminogenic effects (that is, they may make people more likely to reoffend). This sort of response, of course, makes the prohibition of disproportionate punishment a contingent matter; in other words, if extremely harsh sentences did help to reduce crime and this produced, on balance, the best overall consequences, then consequentialism would appear to endorse such sentences. Critics thus charge that consequentialist accounts are unappealing insofar as they are unable to ground more than a contingent prohibition on disproportionately harsh punishment.

Even if we prohibit punishment of the innocent or disproportionate punishment of the guilty, a third, Kantian objection holds that consequentialist punishment is not properly responsive to the person being punished. According to this objection, to punish offenders as a means to securing some valuable social end (namely, crime reduction) is to use them as mere means, rather than respecting them as ends in themselves (Kant, 1797: 473; Murphy, 1973).

In response to this objection, some scholars have contended that although consequentialists regard punishment as a means to an end, punishment does not treat offenders as mere means to this end. If we limit punishment to those who have been found guilty of crimes, then this treatment is arguably responsive to their choices and does not use them as mere means. Kant himself suggested that as long as we reserve punishment only for those found guilty of crimes, then it is permissible to punish with an eye toward potential benefits (Kant, 1797: 473).

A more recent objection to consequentialist systems of punishment, developed by R. A. Duff (1986, 2001), charges that consequentialist systems of punishment, with their focus on crime reduction, treat offenders as dangerous “outsiders”—as the “they” whom “we,” the law-abiding members of society, must threaten, incapacitate, or remold to ensure our safety. Such a conception of the criminal law is inappropriately exclusionary, Duff claims. The criminal law, and the institution of punishment, in a liberal polity should treat offenders inclusively, as (still) members of the community who despite having violated its values could, and should, nevertheless (re)commit to these values.

In response, one might object that systems of punishment aimed at crime reduction need not be exclusionary in the way Duff suggests. In particular, punishment that aims to deter crime might be said to treat all community members equally, namely as potential offenders. For those who have not committed crimes, deterrent punishment regards them as potential offenders and aims to provide an incentive not to offend (that is, general deterrence). For those who have committed crimes, deterrent punishment similarly regards them as potential (re)offenders and aims to provide an incentive not to (re)offend (that is, specific deterrence). In this way, punishment with a deterrent aim might be said to speak to all community members in the same terms, and thus not to be objectionably exclusionary.

4. Retributivist Accounts

As we have seen, consequentialist accounts of punishment are essentially forward-looking—punishment is said to be justified in virtue of the consequences it helps to produce. A different sort of account regards punishment as justified not because of what it brings about, but instead because it is an intrinsically appropriate response to crime. Accounts of the second sort have traditionally been described as retributivist. In general, we can say that retributivism views punishment as justified because it is deserved, although particular accounts differ about what exactly this means.

Theorists have distinguished two varieties of retributivism: positive retributivism and negative retributivism. Positive retributivism is typically characterized as the view that an offender’s desert provides a positive justifying reason for punishment; in other words, the state should punish those who are found guilty of criminal wrongdoing because they deserve it. Negative retributivism, by contrast, provides a constraint on punishment: punishment is justified only of those who deserve it. Because negative retributivism provides only a constraint on punishment, not a positive reason to punish, the negative retributive constraint has featured prominently in attempts at mixed accounts of punishment; such accounts allow punishment for consequentialist aims as long as the punishment is only of those who deserve it. On the other hand, because negative retributivism does not provide a positive justifying reason to punish, some scholars argue that it does not properly count as retributivism at all.

The distinction between retributivism and consequentialism is not always a neat one. Notice that one might endorse the claim that punishment is a deserved response to wrongdoing and then further assert that it is a valuable state of affairs when wrongdoers get the punishment they deserve—a state of affairs that therefore should be promoted. On this type of account, retribution itself essentially becomes the consequentialist aim of punishment (Moore, 1903; Zaibert, 2006). Nevertheless, in keeping with general practice, this article will treat retributivism as distinct from, and in competition with, consequentialist accounts.

a. Deserved Suffering

One common version of retributivism contends simply that wrongdoers deserve to suffer in proportion to their wrongdoing. Often this claim is made by way of appeal to intuitions about particular, usually heinous crimes: surely the unrepentant war criminal, for example, who has tortured and murdered many innocent people, deserves to suffer for what he has done. Proponents argue that retributivism is justified because it best accounts for our intuitions about particular cases such as these (Moore, 1987; Kleinig, 1973).

Justifying retributivism requires more, of course, than merely appealing to common intuitions about such cases. After all, even if many (even most) people do feel, in hearing reports of terrible crimes, that the perpetrators deserve to suffer, not everyone feels this way. And even those who do have such intuitions may not feel entirely comfortable with them. What we would like to know is whether the intuitions themselves are justified, or whether, for instance, they amount to an unhealthy desire for vengeance. Critics contend that those who rely on our intuitions about particular cases as evidence that retributivism is justified fail to provide the needed explanation of why the intuitions are justified.

There are other questions for such a view: does any sort of moral wrongdoing deserve to be met with suffering, or only some cases of wrongdoing? Which ones? And why is meting out deserved suffering for wrongdoing properly the concern of the state?

b. Fair Play

Another prominent type of retributivist account begins with a conception of society as a cooperative venture in which each member benefits when there is general compliance with the rules governing the venture. Because each of us benefits when everyone else plays by the rules, fairness dictates that we each have an obligation to reciprocate by playing by the rules, too. A criminal, like other members of society, benefits from general compliance with laws, but she fails to reciprocate by complying with the laws herself. She essentially becomes a free rider, because she counts on others to play by the rules that she violates. By failing to restrain herself appropriately, she gains an unfair advantage over others in society. The justification of punishment is that it corrects this unfair advantage by inflicting burdens on the offender proportionate to the benefit she gained by committing her crime (Morris, 1968).

On the fair play view, then, punishment is justified as a deserved response to an unfair advantage taken against members of society generally. Such an account offers a relatively straightforward answer to the question of why punishment is the state’s business. The state has an interest in assuring those who accept the burdens of compliance with the law that they will not be at a disadvantage to those who would free-ride on the system.

Critics of the fair play view have argued that it provides a counterintuitive conception of the crime to which punishment responds. It seems strange, for instance, to think of the wrong perpetrated by, say, a rapist as a sort of free-riding wrong against society in general, rather than an egregious wrong perpetrated against the victim in particular. In response to this charge, Dagger (1993) argues that crimes may be wrong in both senses: they may wrong particular victims in various ways, but they are also in every case wrongs in the sense of free riding on society generally.

c. Censure

Another influential version of retributivism begins with the claim, discussed earlier, that one of punishment’s distinctive features is that it communicates censure, or condemnation, of the offender for her offense. This retributivist account, developed most notably by R. A. Duff (1986, 2001), takes the censuring feature as the key to establishing punishment’s moral permissibility. Offenders deserve to be censured for what they have done, and punishment is justified because it delivers this censuring message.

Duff understands crimes as public wrongs, as violations of important public values. It follows on this account that the state is the appropriate agent of punishment; the state properly calls offenders to account for their violations of the political community’s shared values.

Censuring involves, in part, urging an offender to think about the wrong she has done, to repent and (re)commit herself to the values that she has violated. Thus it follows from censure accounts such as Duff’s that offender self-reform is an aim of punishment. But notice the crucial distinction between this sort of account and the variety of consequentialist account that aims at offender reform. Although offender reform is an aim of punishment on the censure account, it is not a justifying aim. In other words, on the censure view, punishment is not justified insofar as it tends to promote offender reform. Rather, punishment is justified because it communicates deserved censure. Part of what it means to censure, however, is to urge wrongdoers to repent and reform.

A common critique of the censure view asks why punishment—that is, the imposition of intended burdens—is the proper way to censure wrongdoers. It seems that the polity could communicate messages of censure to offenders without imposing intended burdens; for example, it could issue a public proclamation condemning the crime and blaming the offender. Why, then, is the hard treatment characteristic of punishment an appropriate vehicle for conveying such messages? One type of response, offered by Duff and others (see also Falls, 1987), holds that hard treatment is needed to convey adequately the polity’s condemnation of crimes. Nonpunitive censure—blaming without imposing intended hard treatment—would fail to communicate the seriousness of the wrongdoing.

Also, on Duff’s account, hard treatment can function to induce in offenders the sort of moral reflection that may lead to repentance, reform, and reconciliation (with their victims and the community more generally). Some have objected, however, that such an account implies too intrusive a role for the state. It is not a proper function of the state, critics charge, to seek to induce repentance and moral reform in offenders. Thus even some scholars who agree that punishment is justified as a form of censure nevertheless disagree about the role of the hard treatment element. For Andrew von Hirsch (1993), for instance, the intended burdens characteristic of punishment act as a sort of prudential supplement: punishment, as censure, serves to remind offenders (and community members) of the moral reasons to comply with the law. Punishment, as hard treatment, also provides a prudential threat as a sort of supplement for those of us for whom the moral message is not sufficient. One worry with such an account, however, is whether the prudential threat will tend to drown out the moral message.

d. Other Versions

Alternative versions of retributivism have been offered. Some scholars, for instance, argue that those who commit crimes violate the trust of their fellow community members. Trust, on this account, is an essential feature of a healthy community. Offenders undermine this trust when they victimize others. In such cases, punishment is a deserved response to such violations and an appropriate way to help maintain (or restore) the conditions of trust among community members (see Dimock, 1997). Advocates of this trust-based variety of retributivism must explain which violations of trust rise to the level that warrants criminalization, so that violators should be subject to punishment. Also, we might question whether such accounts are purely retributivist after all: if punishment is justified at least in part as a means of helping to maintain conditions of trust in a community, then this appears to be a consequentialist rationale. On the other hand, if punishment is justified not for what it helps to bring about but rather as an intrinsically appropriate (because deserved) response to violations of trust, then we need an explanation of why such violations deserve punishment, perhaps as opposed to some other form of response.

Another form of retributivism holds that offenders incur a moral debt to their victims, and so they deserve punishment as a way to repay this debt (McDermott, 2001). This moral debt is distinct from the material debt that an offender may incur. In other words, a person who robs from another person incurs a material debt equal to the value of whatever was stolen, but she also incurs a moral debt for violating the victim’s rights. The offender takes not only a material good from the victim but also a moral good. Repayment of material goods does not settle this moral debt, and so punishment is needed to fill this role. As Daniel McDermott characterizes it, punishment serves to deny the ill-gotten moral good to the perpetrator  (McDermott, 2001: 424).

Such an account raises a host of questions: what precisely is the nature of the moral good that has been taken from the victim? How can a moral good be taken away from someone? In what sense (if at all) has the perpetrator gained this good? How does punishment deny this good to the offender, and how does this thereby make things right for the victim?

e. Sentencing

Because retributivism claims that punishment is justified as a deserved response to wrongdoing, retributivist accounts should provide some guidance about what sentences are deserved in particular cases. Typically, retributivists hold that sentences should be no more severe than is deserved. This negative retributivist constraint on sentencing corresponds with the negative retributivist constraint on punishment itself (namely, that punishment is justified only of those who deserve it). By contrast, positive retributivism holds that offenders’ sentences should be no less severe than they deserve. Some scholars find this positive retributivism unappealing because it seems to preclude the state from taking into account mercy or other considerations that might count in favor of lenient sentences. In other words, some are more comfortable with retributivism’s setting a ceiling but not a floor on sentence severity. One question, though, is whether (and if so, why) retributivists are justified in endorsing the negative retributivist constraint on sentencing without also endorsing the positive retributivist constraint.

Retributivists often discuss sentencing in terms of proportionality, where a proportionate sentence is understood as one that is deserved (or at least, on some accounts, not clearly undeserved). Sentences may be proportionate in two senses: first, they may be proportionate (or disproportionate) relative to each other. This sense of proportionality, called ordinal proportionality, holds that similarly serious offenses should receive similarly severe punishments (like cases should be treated alike); that more serious offenses should be punished more harshly than less serious offenses (murder should be punished more harshly than shoplifting, for instance); and that differences in sentence severity should reflect differences in relative seriousness of offenses (because murder is much more serious than shoplifting, murder should carry a much more severe sentence).

Some scholars have challenged the notion of ordinal proportionality constraints in sentencing, both because offenders cannot neatly be distinguished into a manageable number of desert-based groups—Michael Tonry calls this the “illusion of ‘like-situated offenders’” (Tonry, 2011)—and because individual offenders’ subjective experiences of the same sentence may vary greatly. For example, someone who is young, physically imposing, or has no children may have a much different experience of a 10-year prison term from someone who is much older, physically frail, or must leave behind her children to serve the sentence. Considerations such as these do not in themselves demonstrate that the tenets of ordinal proportionality are false (that like cases should not be treated alike, for instance, or that more serious violations should not receive harsher sentences). Rather, these considerations raise challenges to our ability in practice to implement a just sentencing scheme that reflects ordinal proportionality.

Even if sentences can be devised that satisfy ordinal proportionality, however—in other words, even if a sentencing scheme itself is internally proportionate—particular sentences may fail to be proportionate if the entire sentencing scheme is too severe (or lenient). For instance, a sentencing scheme in which even the least offenses were punished with prison terms would appear disproportionate even if sentences in the scheme were proportionate relative to each other. Thus theorists note a second sense of proportionality: cardinal, or nonrelative, proportionality. Cardinal proportionality considers whether sentences are commensurate with the crimes they punish. A prison term for jaywalking would appear to violate cardinal proportionality, because such a sentence strikes us as too severe given the offense, even if this sentence were proportionate with other sentences in a sentencing scheme—that is, even if it satisfied ordinal proportionality. Thus cardinal proportionality concerns not the relation of sentences to one another, but instead the relation of a sentence to the crime to which it is a response. Put another way, even if an entire sentencing scheme is internally (ordinally) proportionate, we need guidance in how to anchor the sentencing scheme to the crimes themselves so that offenders in particular cases receive the sentences they deserve.

In addition to addressing questions of deserved sentence severity, we would like retributivism to provide some guidance about how to determine what mode, or form, of punishment is appropriate in response to a given crime. Is prison time, community service, capital punishment, probation, or something else the deserved form of response, and why?

The implications of retributivism for sentencing will depend on the specific account’s explanation of why punishment is said to be the deserved response to offending.

Those who appeal to intuitions that the guilty deserve to suffer, for instance, can similarly appeal to intuitions that those who are guilty of more serious offenses deserve to suffer more than those who are guilty of less serious offenses. As discussed, however, we would like to know how much punishment is deserved in particular cases in nonrelative terms, and also what form the suffering should take. One well-known account of sentencing is provided by lex talionis (that is, an eye for an eye, a tooth for a tooth). Immanuel Kant famously endorsed this principle: “Accordingly, whatever undeserved evil you inflict upon another within the people, that you inflict upon yourself” (Kant, 1797: 473). As critics have noted, though, not every crime appears to have an obvious like-for-like response—what would lex talionis demand for the childless kidnapper, for instance (Shafer-Landau, 2000: 193)? And even when a like-for-like response is clearly indicated, it will not always be palatable (torturing the torturer, for example).

We might assert instead that the sentence and the offense need not be alike in kind, but that the sentence should impose an amount of suffering equal to the harm done by the offender. Still, questions arise of how to make interpersonal comparisons of suffering. And again, for the most heinous crimes, a principle of inflicting equal amounts of suffering may recommend sentences that we would find troubling.

The fair play view holds that punishment functions to remove an unfair advantage gained by an offender relative to members of society generally. Critics of this view often object, however, that it provides insufficient or counterintuitive guidance about sentencing. Put simply, there does not seem to be any advantage that an offender gains, in proportion with the seriousness of her crime, relative to community members generally. On one version of the view, the offender gains freedom from the burden of self-constraint that others accept in complying with the particular law that the offender violates. If so, then the sentence severity should be proportionate to the burden others feel in complying with that law. But compliance with laws is often not a burden for most citizens. Indeed, it is often less burdensome to comply with prohibitions on serious offenses (murder, assault, and so forth) than it is to comply with prohibitions on lesser crimes (tax evasion, jaywalking, and so forth), given that we are more often tempted to commit the lesser crimes. But if the unfair advantage that punishment aims to remove is freedom from the burden of self-constraint, and if self-constraint is often more burdensome with lesser crimes, then these less serious crimes will often appear to merit relatively more severe punishments. This is a violation of ordinal proportionality.

Similar problems arise for other versions of the fair play view. Suppose, for instance, that the unfair advantage a criminal gains is not freedom from the burden of complying with the particular law she violates, but rather freedom from complying with the rule of law in general. This general compliance, Richard Dagger writes, is a genuine burden: “there are times for almost all of us when we would like to have the best of both worlds—that is, the freedom we enjoy under the rule of law plus freedom from the burden of obeying laws” (Dagger, 1993: 483). Critics have objected, however, that on this conception of the unfair advantage all offenses become, for the purposes of punishment, the same offense. Both the murderer’s and the tax cheat’s unfair advantage is freedom from compliance with the rule of law generally. If the unfair advantage is the same, however, then removing the advantage would seem to require equal sentences. Again, such sentencing appears to violate ordinal proportionality.

For the censure view, questions arise about what form of punishment and what severity will communicate the deserved message of condemnation in particular cases. On such a view, the principles of ordinal proportionality appear to follow straightforwardly: censure should reflect the seriousness of the wrongdoing, and so if punishment is the vehicle of communicating censure, then sentences should reflect the appropriate relative degree of censure for each case.

The censure view should provide guidance not only about how severely to punish crimes relative to each other, but also how severely to punish in absolute terms, and also the appropriate mode of punishment. To say that manslaughter should be censured more severely than theft, for instance, does not actually tell us how severely to censure manslaughter or theft, or with what form of punishment. Again, the challenge is in determining how to anchor the sentencing scale to actual offenses. Should the least serious offenses receive censure in the form of a small fine, a day in jail, or a year in jail? Should the most serious offenses receive capital punishment, life imprisonment, or some less severe sentence?

Similar questions arise for accounts that characterize punishment as a deserved response to violations of trust, or as a deserved response to the incurrence of a moral debt. What form and severity of punishment is appropriate to maintain conditions of community trust in response to attempted kidnapping, or the theft of a valuable piece of art? How severe must a sentence be to resolve the moral debt that is incurred when one impersonates a police officer, or cheats on her taxes?

Indeed, questions about fixing deserved sentences in response to particular offenses arise for retributivist accounts generally. Critics have charged that retributivism is unable to provide adequate, nonarbitrary guidance about either the deserved severity or deserved form of punishment in particular cases (see Shafer-Landau, 2000).

Retributivists are, of course, aware of such objections and have sought to meet them in various ways. Nonetheless, questions about proportionate sentencing continue to be a central challenge for retributivist accounts.

5. Alternative Accounts

In part as a response to objections commonly raised against consequentialist or retributivist views, a number of theorists have sought to develop alternative accounts of punishment.

a. Rights Forfeiture

At the outset, we said that the central question of punishment’s permissibility is why (if at all) it is permissible to treat those who have committed criminal offenses in ways that typically would be impermissible. For some theorists, this question is best cast in terms of rights: why are the sorts of intended burdens characteristic of punishment, which would constitute rights violations if imposed on those who have not been convicted of criminal wrongdoing, not violations of the rights of those punished?

One way in which punishment would not violate the rights of offenders is if, in committing the crime for which they are convicted, they forfeit the relevant right(s). Because offenders forfeit their right not to be punished, the state has no corresponding duty not to punish them. As W. D. Ross writes, “the offender, by violating the life or liberty or property of another, has lost his own right to have his life, liberty, or property respected, so that the state has no prima facie duty to spare him, as it has a prima facie duty to spare the innocent” (1930: 60-61).

Notice that the forfeiture view itself does not imply any particular positive justification of punishment; it merely purports to explain why punishing offenders does not violate their rights. This is consistent with maintaining that the positive justification of punishment is that it helps reduce crime, or conversely, that wrongdoers deserve to be punished. Thus the forfeiture view does not provide a complete account of the justification of punishment. Proponents, however, take this feature to be a virtue rather than a weakness of the view.

The forfeiture claim raises a number of key questions: first, why does someone who violates the law thereby forfeit the right not to be punished? For those who are gripped by the dilemma of why punishing offenders does not violate their rights, the mere answer that offenders forfeit their rights, without some deeper account of what this forfeiture amounts to, may seem inadequate. Thus some theorists attempt to ground their forfeiture claim in a more comprehensive moral or political theory (see, for instance, Morris, 1991).

Second, what is the nature of the rights forfeited? Do offenders forfeit the same rights they violate? If so, then this raises some of the same challenges as we saw with certain forms of retributivism: what right is forfeited by a childless kidnapper, for example? Alternatively, is the forfeited right simply the right not to be punished? If every offender forfeits this same, general right, then on what basis can we distinguish what sentence is permissible for different offenders? For example, if the burglar forfeits the same right as the murderer, then what prevents us from imposing the same punishment in each case (could two offenders forfeit the same right to different degrees, as some have suggested)?

Third, how should we determine the duration of the forfeiture? Fourth, if an offender forfeits her right against punishment, then why does the state maintain an exclusive right to punish? Why are other individuals not permitted to punish?

b. Consent

Rights forfeiture theorists argue that punishment does not violate offenders’ rights because offenders forfeit the relevant rights. Another way that punishment might be said not to violate offenders’ rights is if offenders waive their rights. This is the central claim of the consent view. Defended most notably by C. S. Nino (1983), the consent view holds that when a person voluntarily commits a crime while knowing the consequences of doing so, she effectively consents to these consequences. In doing so, she waives her right not to be subject to punishment. This is not to say that she explicitly consents to being punished, but rather that by her voluntary action she tacitly consents to be subject to what she knows are the consequences.

Like the forfeiture view, the consent view does not supply a positive justification for punishment. To say that a person consents to some treatment does not by itself provide us with a reason to treat her that way. So the consent view, like the forfeiture view, is compatible with consequentialist aims or with the claim that punishment is a deserved response to offending.

One challenge for the consent view is that it does not seem to justify punishment of offenders who do not know that their acts are subject to punishment. For someone to have consented to be subject to certain consequences of an act, she must know of these consequences. What’s more, even if an offender knows she is committing a punishable act, she might not know the extent of the punishment to which she is subject. If so, then it is not clear how she can be said to consent to her punishment. It is not clear, for example, that a robber who knows that robbery is a punishable offense but does not realize the severity of the punishment to which she will be subject thereby consents to her sentence.

By contrast, other critics have charged that the consent view cannot rule out sentences that most of us would find excessive. This is because a person who voluntarily commits an action with knowledge of the legal consequences, whatever these consequences happen to be, has consented to be subject to the consequences. As Larry Alexander has put it: “If the law imposes capital punishment for overparking, then one who voluntarily overparks ‘consents’ to be executed” (Alexander, 1986).

Another difficulty for the consent view is that tacit consent typically can be overridden by explicit denials of consent. Thus it would seem to follow that one who tacitly consents to be subject to punishment could override this tacit consent by explicitly denying that she consents. But of course, we do not think that an offender should be able to avoid punishment by explicitly refusing to consent to it (Boonin, 2008).

c. Self-Defense

Another proposed justification of punishment conceives of punishment as a form of societal self-defense. First consider self-defense in the interpersonal context: When an assailant attacks me, he culpably creates a situation in which harm will occur: either harm to me if I do not effectively defend myself or harm to him if I do. In such a circumstance, I am justified in acting so that the harm falls on my attacker rather than on me. Similarly, when an offender creates a situation in which either she or her victim will be harmed, the state is permitted to use force to ensure that the harm falls on the perpetrator rather than on the victim (Montague, 1995).

So far, this view appears to justify state intervention only to stop ongoing crimes or ward off impending crimes. How does this view justify punishment as a response to past crimes? Advocates of the view claim that the state is not only justified in intervening to stop actual offenses; it is also permitted to threaten the use of force to deter such crimes. For the threat to be credible and thus effective as a deterrent, however, the state will need to follow through on the threat in cases in which offenders are not deterred. Thus punishment of offenders is permissible.

Notice that although the self-defense account views punishment as a deterrent threat, it is not a pure consequentialist account. Crucial to punishment’s permissibility on the self-defense view is the claim that an offender has culpably created the circumstance in which harm will fall either on the perpetrator or the victim. This backward-looking element is missing from pure consequentialist accounts that cite punishment’s deterrent effects in defending the practice.

Critics object that the analogy between self-defense and punishment breaks down in a number of respects. First, many self-defense theorists argue that the logic of defensive force permits the use of such force even against “innocent” threats. But we do not typically believe that, by analogy, punishment of innocent people is permitted, even if such punishment helped to maintain the credibility of a deterrent threat. Second, the degree of force that is permitted to stop an actual attack may far exceed what we intuitively believe would be permitted as punishment of an offense that has already been committed.

Third, it is one thing to follow through on a threat in order to deter the person who has just offended from offending again. It is another thing—and one might argue, more difficult to justify—to punish one person in order to maintain a credible deterrent threat against the public generally. If we believe the primary deterrent effect of punishment is as a general deterrent (rather than as a specific deterrent), then the analogy with typical accounts of self-defense seems strained. It would be as if, to deter the oncoming assailant from following through with his attack, I grab someone nearby (who has previously attacked me) and inflict the same degree of harm that I would aim to inflict on the assailant to defend myself. This might, of course, be permissible if my previous attacker had thereby acquired a duty to protect me from future harm by allowing himself to be punished as a means of maintaining a credible deterrent threat (Tadros, 2011).

d. Moral Education

The moral education view shares certain features of consequentialist accounts as well as retributivist accounts. On this view, punishment is justified as a means of teaching a moral lesson to those who commit crimes (and perhaps to community members more generally, as well).

Like standard consequentialist accounts, the education view acknowledges that part of the story of punishment’s justification involves its importance in reducing crime. But the education theorist also takes seriously the worry expressed by many retributivists that aiming to shape people’s behavior merely by issuing threats is, in G. W. F. Hegel’s words, “much the same as when one raises a cane against a dog; a man is not treated in accordance with his dignity and honour, but as a dog” (Hegel, 1821: 36). By contrast, a central feature of the moral education view is that those who commit crimes are moral agents, capable of reflecting on and responding to moral reasons. Thus moral education theorists view punishment not as a means of conditioning people to behave in certain ways, but rather of “teaching the wrongdoer that the action she did (or wants to do) is forbidden because it is morally wrong and should not be done for that reason” (Hampton, 1984).

Another way to express this difference between the education view and standard consequentialist views is that consequentialist views focus entirely on whether punishment promotes some goal. The education view, however, holds that only certain means are appropriate for pursuing this goal: namely, punishment aims to engage with the offender as a moral agent, to teach her that (and why) her behavior was morally wrong, so that she will reform herself. Thus we can even distinguish the education view from consequentialist accounts that aim at crime reduction through offender reform. For such consequentialist accounts, punishment’s justification is solely a matter of whether, on balance, it promotes these ends. The education view sets offender reform as an end, but it also grounds certain constraints on how we may appropriately pursue this end.

The education view, like the retributive censure view discussed earlier, views punishment as a communicative enterprise. Punishment communicates to offenders (indeed, to the community more generally) that what they have done is wrong. Thus on both accounts, punishment aims to encourage offenders to reform themselves. But whereas the retributive censure theorists view the message conveyed by punishment as justified insofar as it is deserved, education theorists contend that punishment is justified in virtue of what it aims to accomplish. In this respect, the education view sits more comfortably with standard consequentialist accounts than with retributivist views.

The education view conceives of punishment as aiming to confer a benefit on the offender, the benefit of moral education. This is not to say that punishment is not burdensome; as we have seen, its burdensomeness is an essential feature of punishment. But the burdens of punishment are intended to be ultimately beneficial. Thus education theorists roundly reject accounts according to which it is permissible (or even required) to inflict harm on those guilty of wrongdoing. Instead, education theorists hold, following Plato, that we should never do harm to anyone, even those who have wronged us.

Critics have raised various objections to the moral education view. Some are skeptical about whether punishment is the most effective means of moral education. Others point out that many (perhaps most) offenders are not apparently in need of moral education: many offenders realize they are doing something wrong but do so anyway. Even those who do not realize this as they are acting may recognize it soon afterward. Thus they do not seem to need moral education. Finally, some object that the education view is inappropriately paternalistic. According to the education view, after all, the state is justified in coercively restricting offenders’ liberties as a means to conferring a benefit (moral education) on them. Many liberal theorists are uncomfortable, however, with the idea that the state may coerce a person for her own benefit.

e. Hybrid Approaches

Finally, some theorists have responded to seemingly intractable disputes between consequentialists and retributivists by contending that the question of punishment’s permissibility is not actually a single question at all. Instead, establishing punishment’s permissibility involves answering a number of questions: questions about the aim of the practice, about its limits, and so on. Once we distinguish different questions that bear on punishment’s permissibility, we can then recognize that these questions may be answered by appeal to different moral considerations. What emerges is a hybrid account of punishment’s permissibility.

The most famous articulation of a hybrid view comes from H. L. A. Hart (1968), although there have been numerous attempts to develop such accounts both before and after Hart. The specifics of these accounts vary somewhat, but in general the point has been to distinguish the question of punishment’s aim (Hart called this the “general justifying aim”) from the question of how we must constrain our pursuit of that aim. The first question, about punishment’s aim, is usually answered according to consequentialist considerations, whereas the second question, about appropriate constraints, is typically answered by appeal to retributivist principles. In other words, if we are asking what reason could justify society in maintaining a system of punishment, the answer will appeal to punishment’s role in reducing crime, and thereby protecting the safety and security of community members. But if we ask how we may punish in particular cases, the answer will appeal to retributivist principles about proportionality and desert. Some have distinguished these questions in terms of the proper (consequentialist) rationale of legislators in criminalizing certain types of behaviors and the proper (retributivist) rationale of judges in imposing sentences on those who violate the criminal laws.

Although such views are sometimes described as “two-question” or “two-level” views, with the focus on consequentialist aims and retributivist constraints, there is no reason in principle why we should distinguish only two questions. As we saw earlier, punishment actually raises a host of specific normative questions, and so if we accept the general strategy of distinguishing questions and answering them by appeal to different considerations, then there is no reason in principle to stop with only a two-level hybrid theory. A hybrid view might offer distinct considerations in answer to a variety of questions: what is the positive aim of punishment? Does punishment violate offenders’ rights? How severely may we punish in particular cases? What mode of punishment is permissible in particular cases? And so on.

Also, although hybrid theories typically follow the pattern of aims and constraints, so that consequentialism provides the reason to have an institution of punishment and retributivism provides constraints on how we punish, there is no reason in principle why this could not be reversed. A hybrid theory might hold that suffering is an intrinsically appropriate (deserved) response to wrongdoing, but then endorse as a constraint, for example, that such retributive punishment should never tend to undermine offender reform.

Critics have charged hybrid accounts with being ad hoc and unstable. Although we can distinguish different questions related to punishment’s permissibility, it is a mistake to think that the answers to these questions are entirely independent of each other, so that we can answer each by appeal to entirely distinct considerations. For example, if we accept the consequentialist view that punishment’s general justifying aim is that it helps to deter crime, then why would considerations of deterrence not also play a role (even a decisive role) in how severely we punish in particular cases? Why should retributivist proportionality considerations govern in sentencing if these conflict with the pursuit of crime reduction through deterrence?

Retributivists, for their part, often argue that hybrid theories such as Hart’s, on which consequentialism supplies the justifying aim of punishment, relegate retributivism to a peripheral role. Retributivists, after all, tend to regard consequentialism as providing inappropriate reasons to punish. Characterizing retributivism’s role as providing constraints on the pursuit of consequentialist aims is thus unsatisfying to many retributivists.

6. Abolitionism

Some scholars are unpersuaded by any of the standardly articulated justifications of punishment. In fact, they conclude that punishment is morally unjustified, and thus that the practice should be abolished. An obvious question for abolitionists, of course, is what (if anything) should take the place of punishment. That is, how should society respond to those who behave in ways (committing tax fraud, burglary, assault, and so on) that currently are subject to punishment?

One option would be to endorse a model of treatment rather than punishment. On this model, an offender is viewed as manifesting some form of disease or pathology, and the appropriate response is thus to try to treat and cure the person rather than to punish her. Treatment differs from punishment, first, because it need not be burdensome. At least in principle, treatment could be pleasant. In practice, of course, treatment may often be burdensome—indeed, it may involve many of the same sorts of restrictions and burdens as we find with punishment. But even though courses of treatment may be burdensome, treatment does not typically convey the condemnation that is characteristic of punishment. After all, we generally think of those who are sick as warranting sympathy or concern, not condemnation.

Other options for abolitionists would be to endorse some model of restitutive or restorative, rather than criminal, justice. We might require that offenders make restitution to their victims, as defendants in civil lawsuits are often required to make restitution to plaintiffs (Boonin, 2008: 213-75). Or offenders might engage with victims in a process of restorative justice, one in which both offenders and victims play an active role, with aims of repairing the harms done and restoring the relationships that have been damaged (Braithwaite, 1999). Neither the restitutive nor the restorative models are centrally concerned with imposing intended, censuring burdens on offenders.

Not surprisingly, these alternative accounts are themselves subject to various objections. Critics of the treatment model, for instance, charge that it provides insufficient limits on what sort of treatment of offenders is permissible. The aim of “curing” diseased individuals might warrant quite severe treatment, both in scope and duration. Similarly, scholars have argued that the treatment model fails properly to respect offenders, as it treats them merely as patients rather than as moral agents who are responsible, and should be held responsible, for their actions (Morris, 1968).

Critics of the restitutive and restorative models may point out that some crimes do not clearly lend themselves to restitution or restoration: some crimes may seem so heinous that no victim restitution or restoration of relationships is possible. Other crimes do not have clearly specifiable victims. In addition, consequentialists may worry that practices of restitution or restoration may be inadequate as means of crime reduction if, for example, they are less effective than punishment at deterring potential offenders. Retributivists also may argue that something important is lost when we respond to wrongdoing solely with restitutive or restorative practices. Particularly for those who hold that an important function of punishment is to convey societal censure, restitution or restoration may seem inadequate as responses to crime insofar as they are not essentially concerned with censuring offenders. Alternatively, some retributivists argue that the restorative ideals can best be served by a system of retributive punishment (Duff, 2001; Bennett, 2008).

7. References and Further Reading

  • Alexander, Larry (1986). “Consent, Punishment, and Proportionality.” Philosophy & Public Affairs 15:2, 178-82.
  • Bennett, Christopher (2008). The Apology Ritual: A Philosophical Theory of Punishment. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
  • Bentham, Jeremy (1789). An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation. Reprinted in J. H. Burns and H. L. A. Hart (eds.), The Collected Works of Jeremy Bentham: An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation. Oxford, Clarendon Press, 1996.
  • Boonin, David (2008). The Problem of Punishment. New York, Cambridge University Press.
  • Braithwaite, John (1999). “Restorative Justice: Assessing Optimistic and Pessimistic Accounts.” Crime and Justice 25, 1-127.
  • Cullen, Francis T. (2013). “Rehabilitation: Beyond Nothing Works.” Crime and Justice 42:1, 299-376.
  • Dagger, Richard (1993). “Playing Fair with Punishment.” Ethics 103, 473-88.
  • Dimock, Susan (1997). “Retributivism and Trust.” Law and Philosophy 16:1, 37-62.
  • Dolovich, Sharon (2009). “Cruelty, Prison Conditions, and the Eighth Amendment.” New York University Law Review 84:4, 881-979.
  • Duff, R. A. (2001). Punishment, Communication, and Community. Oxford, Oxford University Press.
  • Duff, R. A. (1986). Trials and Punishments. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
  • Falls, M. Margaret (1987). “Retribution, Reciprocity, and Respect for Persons.” Law and Philosophy 6, 25-51.
  • Feinberg, Joel (1965). “The Expressive Function of Punishment.” Monist 49:3, 397-423.
  • Goldman, Alan (1979). “The Paradox of Punishment.” Philosophy & Public Affairs 9:1, 42-58.
  • Hampton, Jean (1984). “The Moral Education Theory of Punishment.” Philosophy & Public Affairs 13, 208-38.
  • Hart, H. L. A. (1968). Punishment and Responsibility: Essays in the Philosophy of Law. New York, Oxford University Press.
  • Hegel, G. W. F. (1821). Philosophy of Right. Trans. S. W. Dyde. Reprinted by Dover Philosophical Classics, 2005.
  • Henrichson, Christian, and Ruth Delaney (2012). The Price of Prisons: What Incarceration Costs Taxpayers. Report of the Vera Institute of Justice, Center on Sentencing and Corrections.
  • Kant, Immanuel (1797). The Metaphysics of Morals. In Immanuel Kant, Practical Philosophy, trans. and ed. Mary J. Gregor. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Kleinig, John (1973). Punishment and Desert. The Hague, Martinus Nijhoff.
  • Lippke, Richard (2001). “Criminal Offenders and Right Forfeiture.” Journal of Social Philosophy 32:1, 78-89.
  • Mauer, Marc, and Meda Chesney-Lind (eds.) (2002). Invisible Punishment: The Collateral Consequences of Mass Imprisonment. The New Press, 2002.
  • McCloskey, H. J. (1957). “An Examination of Restricted Utilitarianism.” The Philosophical Review 66:4, 466-85.
  • McDermott, Daniel (2001). “The Permissibility of Punishment.” Law and Philosophy 20, 403-32.
  • Montague, Phillip (1995). Punishment as Societal Self-Defense. Lanham, Md., Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Moore, G. E. (1903). Principia Ethica. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
  • Moore, Michael S. (1987). “The moral worth of retribution.” In Ferdinand Schoeman (ed.), Responsibility, Character, and the Emotions: New Essays in Moral Psychology. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
  • Morris, Christopher (1991). “Punishment and Loss of Moral Standing.” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 21, 53-79.
  • Morris, Herbert (1968). “Persons and Punishment.” Monist 52, 475-501.
  • Moskos, Peter (2011). In Defense of Flogging. New York, Basic Books.
  • Murphy, Jeffrie G. (1973). “Marxism and Retribution.” Philosophy & Public Affairs 2:3, 217-43.
  • Nagin, Daniel S. (2013). “Deterrence in the Twenty-First Century.” Crime and Justice 42:1, 199-263.
  • Nino, C. S. (1983). “A Consensual Theory of Punishment.” Philosophy & Public Affairs 12:4, 289-306.
  • Plato (1997). Crito. In Plato: Complete Works Indianapolis, Hackett Publishing Company, Inc.
  • Reiman, Jeffrey H. (1985). “Justice, Civilization, and the Death Penalty: Answering van den Haag.”  Philosophy & Public Affairs 14:2, 115-48.
  • Ross, W. D. (1930). The Right and the Good. Oxford, Oxford University Press.
  • Shafer-Landau, Russ (2000). “Retributivism and Desert.” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 81, 189-214.
  • Simmons, John A. (1991). “Locke and the Right to Punish.” Philosophy & Public Affairs 20:4, 311-49.
  • Smart, J. J. C. (1973). “An outline of a system of utilitarian ethics.” In J. J. C. Smart and Bernard Williams (eds.), Utilitarianism: For and Against. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
  • Tadros, Victor (2011). The Ends of Harm: The Moral Foundations of Criminal Law. Oxford, Oxford University Press.
  • Tonry, Michael (2011). “Proportionality, Parsimony, and Interchangeability of Punishments.” In Michael Tonry (ed.), Why Punish? How Much? A Reader on Punishment. Oxford, Oxford University Press.
  • Tonry, Michael (2006). “Purposes and Functions of Sentencing.” Crime and Justice 34:1, 1-52.
  • Von Hirsch, Andrew (1993). Censure and Sanctions. Oxford, Oxford University Press.
  • Wellman, Christopher Heath (2009). “Rights and State Punishment.” Journal of Philosophy 106:8, 419-39.
  • Zaibert, Leo (2006). Punishment and Retribution. Aldershot, U.K., Ashgate.


Author Information

Zachary Hoskins
University of Nottingham
United Kingdom

Ethical Expressivism

Broadly speaking, the term “expressivism” refers to a family of views in the philosophy of language according to which the meanings of claims in a particular area of discourse are to be understood in terms of whatever non-cognitive mental states those claims are supposed to express. More specifically, an expressivist theory of claims in some area of discourse, D, will typically affirm both of the following theses. The first thesis—psychological non-cognitivism—states that claims in D express mental states that are characteristically non-cognitive. Non-cognitive states are often distinguished by their world-to-mind direction of fit, which contrasts with the mind-to-world direction of fit exhibited by cognitive states like beliefs. Some common examples of non-cognitive states are desires, emotions, pro- and con-attitudes, commitments, and so forth. According to the second thesis—semantic ideationalism—the meanings or semantic contents of claims in D are in some sense given by the mental states that those claims express. This is in contrast with more traditional propositional or truth-conditional approaches to meaning, according to which the meanings of claims are to be understood in terms of either their truth-conditions or the propositions that they express.

An expressivist theory of truth claims—that is, claims of the form “p is true”—might hold that (i) “p is true” expresses a certain measure of confidence in, or agreement with, p, and that (ii) whatever the relevant mental state, for example, agreement with p, that state just is the meaning of “p is true”. In other words, when we claim that p is true, we neither describe p as true nor report the fact that p is true; rather, we express some non-cognitive attitude toward p (see Strawson 1949). Similar expressivist treatments have been given to knowledge claims (Austin 1970; Chrisman 2012), probability claims (Barker 2006; Price 2011; Yalcin 2012), claims about causation (Coventry 2006; Price 2011), and even claims about what is funny (Gert 2002; Dreier 2009).

“Ethical expressivism”, then, is the name for any view according to which (i) ethical claims—that is, claims like “x is wrong”, “y is a good person”, and “z is a virtue”—express non-cognitive mental states, and (ii) these states make up the meanings of ethical claims. (I shall henceforth use the term “expressivism” to refer only to ethical expressivism, unless otherwise noted.) This article begins with a brief account of the history of expressivism, and an explanation of its main motivations. This is followed by a description of the famous Frege-Geach Problem, and of the role that it played in shaping contemporary versions of the view. While these contemporary expressivisms may avoid the problem as it was originally posed, recent work in metaethics suggests that Geach’s worries were really just symptoms of a much deeper problem, which can actually take many forms. After characterizing this deeper problem—the Continuity Problem—and some of its more noteworthy manifestations, the article explores a few recent trends in the literature on expressivism, including the advent of so-called “hybrid” expressivist views. See also "Non-Cognitivism in Ethics."

Table of Contents

  1. Expressivism and Non-Cognitivism: History and Motivations
  2. The Frege-Geach Problem and Hare’s Way Out
  3. The Expressivist Turn
  4. The Continuity Problem
    1. A Puzzle about Negation
    2. Making Sense of Attitude Ascriptions
    3. Saving the Differences
  5. Recent Trends
    1. Expressivists’ Attitude Problem
    2. Hybrid Theories
    3. Recent Work in Empirical Moral Psychology
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Expressivism and Non-Cognitivism: History and Motivations

The first and primary purpose of this section is to lay out a brief history of ethical expressivism, paying particular attention to its main motivations. In addition to this, the section will also answer a question that many have had about expressivism, namely: what is the difference between expressivism and “non-cognitivism”?

The difference is partly an historical one, such that a history of expressivism must begin with its non-cognitivist ancestry. Discussions of early non-cognitivism typically involve three figures in particular—A. J. Ayer, C. L. Stevenson, and R. M. Hare—and in that respect, this one will be no different. But rather than focusing upon the substance of their views, in this section, we will be more interested in the main considerations that motivated them to take up non-cognitivism in the first place. As we shall see, early non-cognitivist views were motivated mostly by two concerns: first, a desire to avoid unwanted ontological commitments, especially to a realm of “spooky,” irreducibly normative properties; and second, a desire to capture an apparently very close connection between sincere ethical claims and motivation.

In the case of Ayer, his motivation for defending a version of non-cognitivism was relatively clear, since he explains in the Introduction of the second edition of Language, Truth, and Logic (1946), “[I]n putting forward the theory I was concerned with maintaining the general consistency of my position [logical positivism].” As is well known, logical positivists were rather austere in their ontological accommodations, and happy to let the natural sciences decide (for the most part) what gets accommodated. In fact, a common way to interpret their verificationism is as a kind of method for avoiding unwanted ontological commitments—“unwanted” because they do not conform to what Ayer himself described as his and other positivists’ “radical empiricism.” Claims in some area of discourse are meaningful, in the ordinary sense of that term—which, for Ayer, is just to say that they express propositions—only if they are either analytic or empirically verifiable. Claims that are neither analytic nor empirically verifiable—like most religious claims, for instance—are meaningless; they might express something, but not propositions.

Ayer’s positivism could perhaps make room for moral properties as long as those properties were understood as literally nothing but the natural properties into which philosophers sometimes analyze them—for example, maximizing pleasure, since this is in principle verifiable—but it left no room at all for the irreducibly normative properties that some at the time took to be the very subject-matter of ethics (see Moore 1903). So in order to “maintain the general consistency of his position,” and to avoid any commitment to empirically unverifiable, irreducibly normative properties, Ayer’s positivism meant that he had to construe ordinary ethical claims as expressing something other than propositions. Moreover, for reasons unimportant to my purposes here, he argued that these claims express non-cognitive, motivational states of mind—in particular, emotions. It is for this reason that Ayer’s brand of non-cognitivism is often referred to as “emotivism”.

Stevenson likely shared some of Ayer’s ontological suspicions, but this pretty clearly is not what led him to non-cognitivism. Rather than being concerned to maintain the consistency of any pre-conceived philosophical principles, Stevenson begins by simply observing our ordinary practices of making ethical claims, and then he asks what kind of analysis of “good” is able to make the best sense out of these practices. For instance, in practice, he thinks ethical claims are made more to influence others than to inform them. In fact, in general, Stevenson seems especially impressed with what he called the “magnetism” of ethical claims—that is, their apparently close connection to people’s motivational states. But he thinks that other attempts to analyze “good” in terms of these motivational states have failed on two counts: (a) they make genuine ethical disagreement impossible, and (b) they compromise the autonomy of ethics, assigning ethical facts to the province of psychology, or sociology, or one of the natural sciences.

According to Stevenson, these other theories err in conceiving the connection between ethical claims and motivational states in terms of the former describing, or reporting, the latter—so that, for instance, the meaning of “Torture is wrong” consists in something like the proposition that I (the speaker) disapprove of torture. This is what led to problems (a) and (b) from above: two people who are merely describing or reporting their own attitudes toward torture cannot be genuinely disagreeing about its wrongness; and if the wrongness of torture were really just a matter of people’s attitudes toward it, then ethical inquiries could apparently be settled entirely by such means as introspection, psychoanalysis, or even just popular vote. Stevenson’s non-cognitivism, then, can be understood as an attempt to capture the relation between ethical claims and motivational states in a way that avoids these problems.

The solution, he thinks, is to allow that ethical claims have a different sort of meaning from ordinary descriptive claims. If ordinary descriptive claims have propositional meaning—that is, meaning that is a matter of the propositions they express—then ethical claims have what Stevenson called emotive meaning. “The emotive meaning of a word is a tendency of a word, arising through the history of its usage, to produce (result from) affective responses in people.  It is the immediate aura of feeling which hovers about a word” (Stevenson 1937, p.23; see also Ogden and Richards 1923, 125ff). A claim like “Torture is the subject of today’s debate” may get its meaning from a proposition, but the claim “Torture is wrong” has emotive meaning, in that its meaning is somehow to be understood in terms of the motivational states that it is typically used either to express or to arouse.

If Ayer and Stevenson apparently disagreed over the meaningfulness of ethical claims, with Ayer at times insisting that such claims are meaningless, and Stevenson allowing that they have a special kind of non-propositional meaning, they were nonetheless united in affirming a negative semantic thesis, sometimes called semantic non-factualism, according to which claims in some area of discourse—in this case, ethical claims—do not express propositions, and, consequently, do not have truth-conditions. Regardless of whether or not ethical claims are meaningful in some special sense, they are not meaningful in the same way that ordinary descriptive claims are meaningful, that is, in the sense of expressing propositions. Ayer and Stevenson were also apparently united in affirming what we earlier called psychological non-cognitivism. So as the term shall be used here, ‘ethical non-cognitivism’ names any view that combines semantic non-factualism and psychological non-cognitivism, with respect to ethical claims.

According to Hare, ethical claims actually have two kinds of meaning: descriptive and prescriptive. To call a thing “good” is both (a) to say or imply that it has some context-specific set of non-moral properties; this is the claim’s descriptive meaning, and (b) to commend the thing in virtue of these properties (this is the claim’s prescriptive meaning). But importantly, the prescriptive meaning of ethical claims is primary: the set of properties that I ascribe to a thing when calling it “good” varies from context to context, but in all contexts, I use “good” for the purpose of commendation. For Hare, then, ethical claims are used not to express emotions, or to excite the emotions of others, but rather to guide actions. They do this by taking the imperative mood. That is, they are first-and-foremost prescriptions. For this reason, Hare’s view is often called “prescriptivism”.

It may be less clear than it was in the case of Ayer and Stevenson whether Hare’s prescriptivism ought to count as a version of non-cognitivism. After all, it is not uncommon to suppose that sentences in the imperative mood still have propositional content. Since he rarely goes in for talk of “expression”, it is unclear whether Hare is a psychological non-cognitivist. However, it would nonetheless be fair to say that, since prescriptions do not have truth-conditions, Hare is committed to saying that the relationship between prescriptive ethical claims and propositions is fundamentally different from that between ordinary descriptive claims and propositions; and in this sense, it does seem as if he is committed to a form of semantic non-factualism. It also seems right to think that if we do not express any sort of non-cognitive, approving attitude toward a thing when we call it “good,” then we do not really commend it. So even if he is not explicit in his adherence to it, Hare does seem to accept some form of psychological non-cognitivism as well.

Also unclear are Hare’s motivations for being an ethical non-cognitivist. By the time Hare published The Language of Morals (1952), non-cognitivism was already the dominant view in moral philosophy. So there was much less of a need for Hare to motivate the view than there was for Ayer and Stevenson a couple decades earlier. Instead, Hare’s concern was mostly to give a more thorough articulation of the view than the other non-cognitivists had, and one sophisticated enough to avoid some of the problems that had already arisen for earlier versions of the view.

One thing that does appear to have motivated Hare’s non-cognitivism, however, is its ability to explain intuitions about moral supervenience. Most philosophers agree that there is some kind of relationship between a thing’s moral status and its non-moral features, such that two things cannot have different moral statuses without also having different non-moral features. This is roughly what it means to say that a thing’s moral features supervene upon its non-moral features. For example, if it is morally wrong for Stan to lie to his teacher, but not morally wrong for Stan to lie to his mother, then there must be some non-moral difference between the two actions that underlies and explains their moral difference, for example, something to do with Stan’s reasons for lying in each case. While non-philosophers may not be familiar with the term “supervenience”, the fact that we so often hold people accountable for judging like cases suggests that we do intuitively take the moral to supervene upon the non-moral.

Those philosophers, like Moore, who believe in irreducibly normative properties must explain how it is that, despite apparently not being reducible to non-moral properties, these properties are nonetheless able to supervene upon non-moral properties, which has proven to be an especially difficult task (see Blackburn 1988b). But non-cognitivists like Hare do not shoulder this difficult metaphysical burden. Instead, they explain intuitions about moral supervenience in terms of rational consistency. If Joan commends something in virtue of its non-moral properties, but then fails to commend something else with an identical set of properties, then she is inconsistent in her commendations, and thereby betrays a certain sort of irrationality. It is this simple expectation of rational consistency, and not some complicated thesis about the ontological relations that obtain between moral and non-moral properties, that explains our intuitions about moral supervenience.

Not long after Hare’s prescriptivism hit the scene, ethical non-cognitivism would be the target of an attack from Peter Geach. Given that the attack was premised upon a point made earlier by German philosopher Gottlob Frege, it has come to be known as the Frege-Geach Problem for non-cognitivism. In the next section, we will see what the Frege-Geach Problem is. Before doing so, however, let us briefly return to the question raised at the beginning of this section: what is the difference between expressivism and non-cognitivism?

In the introduction, we saw that ethical expressivism is essentially the combination of two theses concerning ethical claims: psychological non-cognitivism and semantic ideationalism. As we will see in Sections 2 and 3, the Frege-Geach Problem pressures the non-cognitivist to say more about the meanings of ethical claims than just the non-factualist thesis that they are not comprised of truth-evaluable propositions. It is partly in response to this pressure that contemporary non-cognitivists have been moved to accept semantic ideationalism. So the difference between expressivism and non-cognitivism is historical, but it is not merely historical.  Rather, the difference is substantive as well: both expressivists and non-cognitivists accept some form of psychological non-cognitivism; but whereas the earlier non-cognitivists accepted a negative thesis about the contents of ethical claims—essentially, a thesis about how ethical claims do not get their meanings—contemporary expressivists accept a positive thesis about how ethical claims do get their meanings: ethical claims mean what they do in virtue of the non-cognitive mental states they express. It should be noted, however, that there are still many philosophers who use the terms “non-cognitivism” and “expressivism” interchangeably.

2. The Frege-Geach Problem and Hare’s Way Out

Non-cognitivist theories have met with a number of objections throughout the years, but none as famous as the so-called Frege-Geach Problem. As a point of entry into the problem, observe that there are ordinary linguistic contexts in which it seems correct to say that a proposition is being asserted, and contexts in which it seems incorrect to say that a proposition is being asserted.  Consider the following two sentences:

(1)        It is snowing.

(2)        If it is snowing, then the kids will want to play outside.

In ordinary contexts, to make claim (1) is to assert that it is snowing. That is, when a speaker utters (1), she puts forward a certain proposition—in this case, the proposition that it is snowing—as true. Accordingly, if we happen to know that it is not snowing, it could be appropriate to say that the speaker is wrong.  But when a speaker utters (2), she does not thereby assert that it is snowing. Someone can coherently utter (2) without having any idea whether it is snowing, or even knowing that it is not snowing. In the event that it is not snowing, we should not then say that the speaker of (2) is wrong. However, whether “It is snowing” is being asserted or not, it surely means the same thing in the antecedent of (2) as it does in (1). Equally, while we should not say that the speaker of (2) is wrong if it happens not to be snowing, it would nonetheless be correct, in that event, to say that both (1) and the antecedent of (2) are false.

This is what Geach calls “the Frege point,” a reference to German philosopher Gottlob Frege: “A thought may have just the same content whether you assent to its truth or not; a proposition may occur in discourse now asserted, now unasserted, and yet be recognizably the same proposition” (Geach 1965, p.449). The best way to account for the facts that (a) claim (1) and the antecedent of (2) have the same semantic contents, and that (b) they are both apparently capable of truth and falsity, is to suppose that claim (1) and the antecedent of (2) both express the proposition that it is snowing. So apparently, a claim’s expressing a proposition is something wholly independent of what a speaker happens to be doing with the claim, e.g., whether asserting it or not.

Now, we should note two things about the theories of early non-cognitivists like Ayer, Stevenson, and Hare. First, they are meant only to apply to claims in the relevant area of discourse—in this case, ethical claims—and are not supposed to generalize to other sorts of claims. In other words, theirs are apparently specialized, or “local,” semantic theories. So, for instance, most ethical non-cognitivists would agree that claim (1) expresses the proposition that it is snowing, and that this accounts for the meaning of (1). Second, perhaps understandably, ethical non-cognitivists focus their theories almost entirely upon ethical claims when they are asserted. The basic question is always something like this: what really is going on when a speaker makes an assertion of the form ‘x is wrong’? Does the speaker thereby describe x as wrong? Or might it be a kind of fallacy to assume that the speaker is engaged in an act of description, based only upon the surface grammar of the sentence? Might she instead be doing something expressive or evocative? Geach observes, “Theory after theory has been put forward to the effect that predicating some term ‘P’—which is always taken to mean: predicating ‘P’ assertorically—is not describing an object as being P but some other ‘performance’; and the contrary view is labeled ‘the Descriptive Fallacy’” (Geach 1965, p.461). Little attention is paid to ethical claims in contexts where they are not being asserted.

The Frege-Geach Problem can be understood as a consequence of these two features of non-cognitivist theories. As we saw earlier with claims (1) and (2), when we embed a claim into an unasserted context, like the antecedent of a conditional, we effectively strip the claim of its assertoric force. Claim (1) is assertoric, but the antecedent of (2) is not, despite having the same semantic content. But as Geach points out, exactly the same phenomenon occurs when we take a claim at the heart of some non-cognitivist theory and embed it into an unasserted context. This is why the Frege-Geach Problem is sometimes called the Embedding Problem. For example, consider the following two claims, similar in form to claims (1) and (2):

(3)        Lying is wrong.

(4)        If lying is wrong, then getting your little brother to lie is wrong.

As with claims (1) and (2) above, the relationship between a speaker and claim (3) is importantly different from the relationship between a speaker and the antecedent of claim (4). At least in ordinary contexts, a speaker of (3) asserts that lying is wrong, whereas a speaker of (4) does no such thing. But, assuming “the Frege point” applies here as well, the semantic contents of (3) and the antecedent of (4) do not depend upon whether they are being asserted or not. In both cases, their contents ought to be the same; and therein lies the rub for ethical non-cognitivists.

Given that their theories are meant to apply only to ethical claims, and not to claims in other areas of discourse, non-cognitivists are apparently committed to telling a radically different story about the semantic content of (3), as compared to the propositional story they would presumably join everyone else in telling about the contents of claims like (1) and (2). But whatever story they tell about the content of (3), it is unclear how it could apply coherently to the antecedent of (4) as well. Take Ayer, for instance. According to Ayer, claim (3) is semantically no different from

(3’)      Lying!!

“where the shape and thickness of the exclamation marks show, by a suitable convention, that a special sort of moral disapproval is the feeling which is being expressed” (Ayer (1946)1952, p.107). Ayer believed that speakers of claims like (3) are not engaged in acts of description, but rather acts of expressing their non-cognitive attitudes toward various things. This is how Ayer’s theory treats the contents of ethical claims when they are asserted. Now, absent some independently compelling reason for thinking that “the Frege point” should not apply here, the same analysis ought to be given to the antecedent of (4). But the same analysis cannot be given to the antecedent of (4). For, just as a speaker can sincerely and coherently utter (2) without believing that it is snowing, a speaker can sincerely and coherently utter (4) without disapproving of lying. So whatever Ayer has to say about the content of the antecedent of (4), it cannot be that it consists in the expression of “a special sort of moral disapproval,” since a speaker of (4) does not express disapproval of lying. Apparently, then, he is committed to saying, counter-intuitively, that the contents of (3) and the antecedent of (4) are different.

As Geach poses it, the problem for the ethical non-cognitivist at this point is actually two-fold (see especially Geach 1965: 462-465). First, the non-cognitivist must explain how ethical claims are able to function as premises in logical inferences in the first place, if they do not express propositions. Traditionally, inference in logic is thought to be a matter of the truth-conditional relations that hold between propositions, and logical connectives like “and”, “or”, and “if-then” are thought to be truth-preserving functions from propositions to propositions. But as we have already seen, ethical non-cognitivists deny that ethical claims are even in the business of expressing propositions. So how, Geach wonders, are we apparently able to infer

(5)        Therefore, getting your little brother to lie is wrong

from (3) and (4), if the content of (3) is nothing more than an attitude of disapproval toward lying?  Or consider:

(6)        Lying is wrong or it isn’t.

Claim (6) can be inferred from (3) by a familiar logical principle, and in non-ethical contexts, we account for this by explaining how disjunction relates two or more propositions. But how can someone who denies that (3) expresses a proposition explain the relationship between (3) and (6)? The second part of the problem, related to the first, is that the non-cognitivist must explain why the inference from (3) and (4) to (5), for instance, is a valid one. As any introductory logic student knows well, the validity of modus ponens depends upon the minor premise and the antecedent of the major premise having the same content. Otherwise, the argument equivocates, and the inference is invalid. But as we just saw, on the theories of non-cognitivists like Ayer, claim (3) and the antecedent of (4) apparently do not have the same content. So Ayer seems committed to saying that what appears to be a straightforward instance of modus ponens is in fact an invalid argument. This is the so-called Frege-Geach Problem for non-cognitivism as Geach originally put it.

In response to an argument very much like Geach’s (see Searle 1962), Hare appears to give non-cognitivists a “way out” of the Frege-Geach Problem (Hare 1970). As Hare sees it, the matter ultimately comes down to whether or not the non-cognitivist can adequately account for the compositionality of language, that is, the way the meanings of complex sentences are composed of the meanings of their simpler parts. As has already been noted, linguists and philosophers of language have traditionally done this by telling a story about propositions and the various relations that may hold between them—the meaning of (2), for instance, is composed of (a) the proposition that it is snowing, (b) the proposition that the kids will want to play outside, and (c) the conditional function “if-then”. The challenge for the non-cognitivist is simply to find another way to account for compositionality—though, it turns out, this is no simple matter.

Hare’s own proposal was to think of the meanings of ethical claims in terms of the sorts of acts for which they are suited and not in terms of propositions or mental states. The claim “Lying is wrong,” for instance, is especially suited for a particular sort of act, namely, the act of condemning lying. Thinking of the meanings of ethical claims in this way allows Hare and other non-cognitivists to effectively concede “the Frege point,” since suitability for an act is something wholly independent of whether a claim is being asserted or not. It allows them, for instance, to say that the content of (3) is the same as the content of the antecedent of (4), which, we saw, was a problem for theories like Ayer’s. From here, accounting for the meanings of complex ethical claims, like (4) and (6), is a matter of conceiving logical connectives not as functions from propositions to propositions, but rather as functions from speech acts to speech acts. If non-cognitivists could do something like this, that is, draw up a kind of “logic of speech acts”, then they would apparently have the resources for meeting both of Geach’s challenges. They could explain how ethical claims can function as premises in logical inferences, and they could explain why some of those inferences, and not others, are valid. Unfortunately, Hare himself stopped short of working out such a logic, but his 1970 paper would nonetheless pave the way for future expressivist theories and their own responses to the Frege-Geach Problem.

3. The Expressivist Turn

Earlier, it was noted that the difference between non-cognitivism and expressivism is both historical and substantive. To repeat, ethical non-cognitivists were united in affirming the negative semantic thesis that ethical claims do not get their meanings from truth-evaluable propositions, as in semantic non-factualism. But as we have already seen with Hare, the Frege-Geach Problem pressures non-cognitivists to say something more than this, in order to account for the meanings of both simple and complex ethical claims, and to explain how some ethical claims can be inferred from others.

Contemporary ethical expressivists respond to this pressure by doing just that: while still affirming the semantic non-factualism of their non-cognitivist ancestors, expressivists nowadays add to this the thesis that was earlier called semantic ideationalism. That is, they think that the meanings of ethical claims are constituted not by propositions, but by the very non-cognitive mental states that they have long been thought to express. In other words, if non-cognitivists “removed” propositions from the contents of ethical claims, then expressivists “replace” those propositions with mental states, or “ideas”—hence, ideationalism. It is this move, made primarily in response to the Frege-Geach Problem, and by following Hare’s lead, that constitutes the historical turn from ethical non-cognitivism to ethical expressivism. Both non-cognitivists and expressivists believe that ethical claims express non-cognitive attitudes, but expressivists are distinguished in thinking of the expression relation itself as a semantic one.

Ethical expressivism is often contrasted with another theory of the meanings of ethical claims according to which those meanings are closely related with speaker’s non-cognitive states of mind, namely, ethical subjectivism. Ethical subjectivism can be understood as the view that the meanings of ethical claims are propositions, but propositions about speakers’ attitudes. So whatever the relationship between claim (1) above and the proposition that it is snowing, the same relationship holds between claim (3) and the proposition that I (the speaker) disapprove of lying. So ethical subjectivists can also, with expressivists, say that ethical claims mean what they do in virtue of the non-cognitive states that they express. But whereas the expressivist accounts for this in terms of the way the claim itself directly expresses the relevant state, the subjectivist accounts for it in terms of the speaker indirectly expressing the relevant state by expressing a proposition that refers to it.

The contrast between expressivism and subjectivism is important not only for the purpose of understanding what expressivism is, but also for seeing a significant advantage that it is supposed to have over subjectivism. Suppose Jones and Smith are engaged in a debate about the wrongness of lying, with Jones claiming that it is wrong, and Smith claiming that it is not wrong.  Presumably, for this to count as a genuine disagreement, it must be the case that their claims have incompatible contents. But according to subjectivism, the contents of their claims, respectively, are the propositions that I (Jones) disapprove of lying and that I (Smith) do not disapprove of lying. Clearly, though, these two propositions are perfectly compatible with each other. Where, then, where is the disagreement? This is often thought to be a particularly devastating problem for ethical subjectivism, that is, it cannot adequately account for genuine moral disagreement, but it is apparently not a problem for expressivists. According to expressivism, the disagreement is simply a matter of Jones and Smith directly expressing incompatible states of mind.  This is one of the advantages of supposing that the semantic contents of ethical claims just are mental states, and not propositions about mental states.

Now, recall the two motivations that first led people to accept ethical non-cognitivism. The first was a desire to avoid any ontological commitment to “spooky,” irreducibly normative properties. Moral realists, roughly speaking, are those who believe that properties like goodness and wrongness have every bit the ontological status as other, less controversial properties, like roundness and solidity, that is, moral properties are no less “real” than non-moral properties. But especially for those philosophers committed to a thoroughgoing metaphysical naturalism, it is hard to see how things like goodness and wrongness could have such a status. Especially when it is noted, as Mackie famously does, that moral properties as realists typically conceive them are somehow supposed to have a kind of built-in capacity to motivate those who apprehend them, to say nothing of how they are supposed to be apprehended, a capacity apparently not had by any other property (see Mackie 1977, p.38-42). Ethical expressivists avoid this problem by denying that people who make ethical claims are even engaged in the task of ascribing moral properties to things in the first place. Ontologically speaking, expressivism demands little more of the world than people’s attitudes and the speakers who express them, and so, it nicely satisfies the first of the two non-cognitivist desiderata.

The second desideratum was a desire to accommodate an apparently very close connection between ethical claims and motivation. In simple terms, motivational internalism is the view that a necessary condition for moral judgment is that the speaker be motivated to act accordingly. In other words, if Jones judges that lying is wrong, but has no motivation whatsoever to refrain from lying, or to condemn those who lie, or whatever, then internalists will typically say that Jones must not really judge lying to be wrong. Even if motivational internalism is false, though, it is surely right that we expect people’s ethical claims to be accompanied by motivations to act in certain ways; and when people who make ethical claims seem not to be motivated to act in these ways, we often assume either that they are being insincere or that something else has gone wrong. Sincere ethical claims just seem to “come with” corresponding motivations. Here, too, expressivism seems well suited to account for this feature of ethical claims, since they take ethical claims to directly express non-cognitive states of mind, for example, desires, emotions, attitudes, commitments, and these states are either capable of motivating by themselves, or at least closely tied to motivation. So while ethical expressivists distinguish themselves from earlier non-cognitivists by accepting the thesis of semantic ideationalism, they are no less capable of accommodating the very same considerations that motivated non-cognitivism in the first place.

Finally, return to the Frege-Geach Problem. As we saw in the previous section, Geach originally posed it as a kind of logical problem for non-cognitivists: by denying that claims in the relevant area of discourse express propositions, non-cognitivists take on the burden of explaining how such claims can be involved in logical inference, and why some such inferences are valid and others invalid. Hare took a first step toward meeting this challenge by proposing that we understand the contents of ethical claims in terms of speech acts, and then work out a kind of “logic” of speech acts. Contemporary expressivists, since they understand the contents of ethical claims not in terms of speech acts but in terms of mental states, are committed to doing something similar with whatever non-cognitive states they think are expressed by these claims. In other words, as it is sometimes put, expressivists owe us a kind of “logic of attitudes.”

Here, again, is our test case:

(3)        Lying is wrong.

(4)        If lying is wrong, then getting your little brother to lie is wrong.

(5)        Therefore, getting your little brother to lie is wrong.

If the meanings of (3), (4), and (5) are to be understood solely in terms of mental states, and not in terms of propositions, how is it that we can infer (5) from (3) and (4)? And why is the inference valid?

In some of his earlier work on this, Blackburn (1984) answers these questions by suggesting that complex ethical claims like (4) express higher-order non-cognitive states, in this case, something like a commitment to disapproving of getting one’s little brother to lie upon disapproving of lying. If someone sincerely disapproves of lying, and is also committed to disapproving of getting her little brother to lie as long as she disapproves of lying—the two states expressed by (3) and (4), respectively—then she thereby commits herself to disapproving of getting her little brother to lie. This is one sense in which (5) might “follow from” (3) and (4), even if it is not exactly the entailment relation with which we are all familiar from introductory logic.

Furthermore, a familiar way to account for the validity of inferences like (3)-(5) is by saying that it is impossible for the premises to be true and for the conclusion to be false. But if the expressivist takes something like the approach under consideration here, he will presumably have to say something different, since it is certainly possible for someone to hold both of the attitudes expressed by (3) and (4) without also holding the attitude expressed by (5). So for instance, the expressivist might say something like this: while a person certainly can hold the attitudes expressed by (3) and (4) without also holding the attitude expressed by (5), such a person would nonetheless exhibit a kind of inconsistency in her attitudes—she would have what Blackburn calls a “fractured sensibility” (1984: 195). It is this inconsistency that might explain why the move from (3) and (4) to (5) is “valid,” provided that we allow for this alternative sense of validity. Recall, that this is essentially the same sort of inconsistency of attitudes that Hare thought underlies our intuitions about moral supervenience.

This is just one way in which expressivists might attempt to solve the Frege-Geach Problem.  Others have attempted different sorts of “logics of attitudes,” with mixed results. In early twenty-first century discourse, the debate about whether such a thing as a “logic of attitudes” is even possible—and if so, what it should look like—is ongoing.

4. The Continuity Problem

Even if expressivists can solve, or at least avoid, the Frege-Geach Problem as Geach originally posed it, there is a deeper problem that they face, a kind of “problem behind the problem”, and that will be the subject of this section. To get a sense of the problem, consider that expressivists have taken a position that effectively pulls them in two opposing directions. On the one hand, since the earliest days of non-cognitivism, philosophers in the expressivist tradition have wanted to draw some sort of sharp contrast between claims in the relevant area of discourse and claims outside of that area of discourse, that is, between ethical and non-ethical claims. But on the other hand, and this is the deeper issue that one might think lies behind the Frege-Geach Problem, ethical claims seem to behave in all sorts of logical and semantic contexts just like their non-ethical counterparts. Ethical claims are apparently no different from non-ethical claims in being (a) embeddable into unasserted contexts, like disjunctions and the antecedents of conditionals, (b) involved in logical inferences, (c) posed as questions, (d) translated across different languages, (e) negated, (f) supported with reasons, and (g) used to articulate the objects of various states of mind, for example, we can say that Jones believes that lying is wrong, Anderson regrets that lying is wrong, and Black wonders whether lying is wrong, to name just a few. It is in accounting for the many apparent continuities between ethical and non-ethical claims that expressivists run into serious problems. So call the general problem here the Continuity Problem for expressivism.

One very significant step that expressivists have taken in order to solve the Continuity Problem is to expand their semantic ideationalism to apply to claims of all sorts, and not just to claims in the relevant area of discourse. So, in the same way that ethical claims get their meanings from non-cognitive mental states, non-ethical claims get their meanings from whatever states of mind they express. In other words, expressivists attempt to solve the Continuity Problem by swapping their “local” semantic ideationalism, that is, ideationalism specifically with respect to claims in the discourse of concern, for a more “global” ideationalist semantics intended to apply to claims in all areas of discourse. This is remarkable, as it represents a wholesale departure from the more traditional propositionalist semantics according to which sentences mean what they do in virtue of the propositions they express. Recall the earlier claims:

(1)        It is snowing.

(3)        Lying is wrong.

According to most contemporary expressivists, the meanings of both (1) and (3) are to be understood in terms of the mental states they express.  Claim (3) expresses something like disapproval of lying, and claim (1) expresses the belief that it is snowing, as opposed to the proposition that it is snowing. So even if ethical and non-ethical claims express different kinds of states, their meanings are nonetheless accounted for in the same way, that is, in terms of whatever mental states the relevant claims are supposed to express.

If nothing else, this promises to be an important first step toward solving the Continuity Problem. But taking this step, from local to global semantic ideationalism, may prove to be more trouble than it is worth, as it appears to raise all sorts of other problems a few of which we shall consider here under the general banner of the Continuity Problem.

a. A Puzzle about Negation

Keeping in mind that expressivism now appears to hinge upon it being the case that an ideationalist approach to semantics can account for all of the same logical and linguistic phenomena that the more traditional propositional or truth-conditional approaches to semantics can account for, consider a simple case of negation:

(1)        It is snowing.

(7)        It is not snowing.

On an ideationalist approach to meaning, (1) gets its meaning from the belief that it is snowing, and (7) gets its meaning from either the belief that it is not snowing, or perhaps a state of disbelief that it is snowing, assuming, for now, that a state of disbelief is something different from a mere lack of belief. A claim and its negation ought to have incompatible contents, and this is apparently how an ideationalist would account for the incompatibility of (1) and (7). But now consider a case of an ethical claim and its negation:

(3)        Lying is wrong.

(8)        Lying is not wrong.

We saw these claims earlier, in Section 3, when discussing how expressivists are supposed to be able to account for genuine moral disagreement in a way better than ethical subjectivists.  Basically, expressivists account for such disagreement by supposing that a speaker of (3) and a speaker of (8) express incompatible mental states, as is the case with (1) and (7).  But if the incompatible states in the case of (1) and (7) are states of belief that p and belief that not-p (or belief and disbelief), what are the incompatible states in this case?

The non-cognitive mental state expressed by (3) is presumably something like disapproval of lying. So what is the non-cognitive state that is expressed by (8)? On the face of it, this seems like it should be an easy question to answer, but upon reflection, it turns out to be really quite puzzling. Whatever is expressed by (8), it should be something that is independently plausible as the content of such a claim, and it should be something that is somehow incompatible with the state expressed by (3). But what is it?

To see why this is puzzling, consider the following three sentences (adapted from Unwin 1999 and 2001):

(9)        Jones does not think that lying is wrong.

(10)      Jones thinks that not lying is wrong.

(11)      Jones thinks that lying is not wrong.

These three sentences say three importantly different things about Jones. Furthermore, it seems as if the state attributed to Jones in (11) should be the very same state as the one expressed by (8) above. But again, what is that state?  Let us proceed by process of elimination. It cannot be that (11) attributes to Jones a state of approval, that is, approving of lying. Presumably, for Jones to approve of lying would be for Jones to think that lying is right, or good. But that is not what (11) says; it says only that he thinks lying is not wrong. Nor can (11) attribute to Jones a lack of disapproval of lying, since that is what is attributed in (9), and as we’ve already agreed, (9) and (11) tell us different things about Jones. Moreover, (11) also cannot attribute to Jones the state of disapproval of not lying, since that is the state being attributed in (10). But at this point, it is hard to see what mental state is left to be attributed to Jones in (11), and to be the content of (8).

The expressivist does not want to say that (3) and (8) express incompatible beliefs, or states of belief and disbelief, as with (1) and (7), since beliefs are cognitive states, and we know that expressivists are psychological non-cognitivists. If (3) and (8) express beliefs, and we share with Hume the idea that beliefs by themselves are incapable of motivating, then we will apparently not have the resources for explaining the close connection between people sincerely making one of these claims and their being motivated to act accordingly. Nor does the expressivist want to say that (3) and (8) express inconsistent propositions, since that would be to abandon her semantic non-factualism. Propositions are often thought to determine truth conditions, and truth conditions are often thought to be ways the world might be. So to allow that (3) and (8) express propositions would presumably be to allow that there is a way the world might be that would make it true that lying is wrong. Furthermore, accounting for this would involve the expressivist in precisely the sort of moral metaphysical inquiries she seeks to avoid. For these reasons, it is crucial for the expressivist to find a non-cognitive mental state to be the content of (8). It must be something incompatible with the state expressed by (3), and it must be a plausible candidate for the state attributed to Jones in (11). But as we have seen, it is very difficult to articulate just what state it is.

Expressivists must show us that, even after accepting global semantic ideationalism, we are still able to account for all of the same phenomena as those accounted for by traditional propositional approaches to meaning. But here it seems they struggle even with something as simple as negation. Further, until they provide a satisfactory explanation of the contents of negated ethical claims, it will remain unclear whether they really do have a better account of moral disagreement than ethical subjectivists, as has long been claimed.

b. Making Sense of Attitude Ascriptions

Earlier, it was noted that ethical claims are no different from non-ethical claims in being able to articulate the objects of various states of mind. Let us now look closer at why expressivists may have a problem accounting for this particular point of continuity between ethical and non-ethical discourse.

(12)      Frank fears that it is snowing.

(13)      Wanda wonders whether it is snowing.

(14)      Haddie hates that it is snowing.

Claims (12)-(14) ascribe three different attitudes to Frank, Wanda, and Haddie. Clearly, however, these three attitudes have something in common, something that can be represented by the claim from earlier

(1)        It is snowing.

Traditionally, the way that philosophers of mind and language have accounted for this is by saying that (1) expresses the proposition that it is snowing, and that what all three of the attitudes ascribed to Frank, Wanda, and Haddie have in common is that they are all directed at one and the same proposition, that is, they all have the same proposition as their object.

By abandoning traditional propositional semantics, though, expressivists take on the burden of finding some other way of explaining how the contents of expressions like “fears that”, “wonders whether”, and “hates that” are supposed to relate to the content of whatever follows them. If the content of (1) is supposed to be something like the belief that it is snowing, as ideationalists suppose, and (1) is also supposed to be able to articulate the object of Frank’s fear, then the expressivist is apparently committed to thinking that Frank’s fear is actually directed at the belief that it is snowing. But, of course, Frank is not afraid of the belief that it is snowing—he is not afraid to believe that it is snowing—rather, he is afraid that it is snowing.

Things are no less problematic in the ethical case. For consider:

(15)      Frank fears that lying is wrong.

(16)      Wanda wonders whether lying is wrong.

(17)      Haddie hates that lying is wrong.

Here again, it seems right to say that the attitudes ascribed in (15)-(17) all share something in common, something that can be represented by the claim from earlier

(3)        Lying is wrong.

But if it is denied that (3) expresses a proposition, as ethical expressivists and non-cognitivists always have, it becomes unclear how (3) could be used to articulate the object of those attitudes.  Focus upon (15) for a moment. Now, what are the contents of ‘fears that’ and ‘lying is wrong’, such that the latter is the object of the former? We presumably have one answer already, from the expressivist: the content of ‘lying is wrong’ in (15), like the content of (3), is an attitude of disapproval toward lying. However, on the plausible assumption that the content of “fears that” is an attitude of fear toward the content of whatever follows, we apparently get the expressivist saying that (15) ascribes to Frank a fear of disapproval of lying, or a fear of disapproving of lying. But surely that is not what (15) ascribes to Frank. He may fear these other things as well, but (15) says only that he fears that lying is wrong.

The expressivist may try to avoid this puzzle by insisting that “lying is wrong” as it appears in (15) has a content that is different from the content of (3), but this still leaves us wondering what the meanings of claims like (15)-(17) are supposed to be, according to the expressivist’s ideationalist semantics. As Schroeder explains, expressivists “owe an account of the meaning of each and every attitude verb, for example, fears that, wonders whether, and so on; just as much as they owe an account of “not”, “and”, and “if … then”. Very little progress has yet been made on how non-cognitivists [or expressivists] can treat attitude verbs, and the prospects for further progress look dim” (Schroeder 2008d, p.716).

c. Saving the Differences

One might think that a simple way to defeat any non-factualist account of ethical claims is simply to point out that we can coherently embed ethical claims into truth claims. It makes perfect sense, for instance, for someone to say, “It is true that lying is wrong.” Presumably, however, this could only make sense if whatever follows “It is true that” is the sort of thing that can be true. Of course, propositions are among the sorts of things that can be true, in fact, this is often thought to be their distinguishing characteristic. But non-factualists deny that ethical claims express propositions. So how do they account for the fact that the truth-predicate seems to apply just as well to ethical claims as it does to non-ethical claims?

If this were a devastating problem for non-cognitivists, then the non-cognitivist tradition in ethics would not have lasted for very long, since philosophers were well aware of the matter soon after Ayer first published Language, Truth, and Logic in 1936. The thought then—essentially just an application of Ramsey’s (1927) famous redundancy theory of truth—was that, in at least some cases, the truth-predicate does not actually ascribe some metaphysically robust property being true to whatever it is being predicated of. Rather, to add the truth-predicate to a claim is to do nothing more than to simply assert the claim by itself. In claiming that “It is true that lying is wrong,” on this view, a speaker expresses the very same state that is expressed by claiming only that “Lying is wrong,” and nothing more; hence, the “redundancy” of the truth predicate.

In early twenty-first century discourse, theories like Ramsey’s are referred to as deflationary or minimalist theories of truth, since they effectively “deflate” or “minimize” the ontological significance of the truth-predicate. Some ethical expressivists, in part as a way of solving the Continuity Problem, have taken to supplementing their expressivism with deflationism. The basic idea goes something like this: if we accept a deflationary theory of truth across the board, we can apparently say that ethical claims are truth-apt, in fact, every bit as truth-apt as any other sort of claim. This allows the expressivist to avoid simple versions of the objection noted at the beginning of this section.  Interestingly, the deflationism need not stop with the truth-predicate. We might also deflate the notion of a proposition by insisting that a proposition is just whatever is expressed by a truth-apt claim. As long as we allow that ethical claims are truth-apt, in some deflationary sense, we may now be able to say, for instance, that

(3)        Lying is wrong

expresses the proposition that lying is wrong, after all. If this is allowed, then the expressivist may now have the resources for accounting for the compositionality of ethical discourse in basically the same way in which traditional propositional semanticists would do so. The meanings of complex ethical claims are to be understood in terms of the propositions expressed by their parts. Once the notion of a proposition is deflated, we might just as well deflate the notion of belief by saying something to the effect that all it is for one to believe that p is for one to accept a claim that expresses the proposition that p. In these ways, perhaps an expressivist can “earn the right” to talk of truth, propositions, and beliefs, and perhaps also knowledge, in the ethical domain, just as they do in non-ethical domains.

This is the essence of Blackburn’s brand of expressivism, known commonly nowadays as ‘quasi-realism’. As we saw earlier, moral realists are those who believe that moral properties have every bit the ontological status as other, less controversial properties, like roundness and solidity. This allows realists to account for things like truth, propositions, beliefs, and knowledge in the ethical domain in precisely the same way that we ordinarily do in other domains, such as those that include facts about roundness and solidity. By deflating the relevant notions, however, Blackburn and other moral non-realists are nonetheless supposed to be able to say all the things that realists say about moral truth, and the like; hence, “quasi”-realism.

There are at least two problems for ethical expressivists who take this approach to solving the Continuity Problem. The first is simply that deflationism is independently a very controversial view. In his own defense of a deflationary theory of truth, Paul Horwich addresses no fewer than thirty-nine “alleged difficulties” faced by such a theory (Horwich 1998). Granted, he apparently believes that all of these difficulties can be addressed with some degree of satisfaction, but few will deny that deflationary theories of truth represent a departure from the common assumption that truth is a real property of things, and that this property consists in something like a thing’s corresponding with reality. Deflationism may help expressivists avoid the Continuity Problem, but at the cost of then burdening them to defend deflationism against its many problems.

A second and more interesting problem, though, is that taking this deflationary route may, in the end, ruin what was supposed to be so unique about expressivism all along. In other words, there is a sense in which deflationism may too good a response to the Continuity Problem. After all, at the core of ethical expressivism is the belief that there is some significant difference between ethical and non-ethical discourse. Recall again our two basic instances of each:

(1)        It is snowing.

(3)        Lying is wrong.

As we just saw, once deflationism is allowed to run its course, we end up saying remarkably similar things about (1) and (3). Both are truth-apt; both express propositions; both can be the objects of belief; both can be known; and so forth. But now you may be wondering: what, then, is supposed to be the significant difference that sets (3) apart from (1)? Or, another way of putting it: what would be the point of contention between an expressivist and her opponents if both parties agreed to deflate such notions as truth, proposition, and belief? This has sometimes been called the problem of “saving the differences” between ethical and non-ethical discourse.

One response to this problem might be to say that the relevant differences between ethical and non-ethical discourse actually occur at a level below the surface of the two linguistic domains. Recall that we deflated the notion of belief by saying that to believe that p is just to accept a claim that expresses the proposition that p. Using these terms, the expressivist might say that the main difference between (1) and (3) is a matter of what is involved in “accepting” the two claims. Accepting an ethical claim like (3) is something importantly different from accepting a non-ethical claim like (1), and presumably the difference has something to do with the types of mental states involved in doing so.  Whether or not this sort of response will work is the subject of an ongoing debate in early twenty-first century philosophical literature.

5. Recent Trends

While the Continuity Problem remains a lively point, or collection of points, of debate between expressivists and their critics, it is certainly not the only topic with which those involved in the literature are currently occupied. Here we review a few other recent trends in expressivist thought, perhaps the most notable among them being the advent of so-called “hybrid” expressivist theories.

a. Expressivists’ Attitude Problem

There are some who would say that the Continuity Problem just is the Frege-Geach Problem, that is, that the Frege-Geach Problem ought to be understood very broadly, so as to include all of the many issues associated with the apparent logical and semantic continuities between ethical and non-ethical discourse. Even so, ethical expressivism faces other problems as well. Let us now look briefly at an issue that is receiving more and more attention these days—the so-called Moral Attitude Problem for ethical expressivism.

Recall again that expressivists often claim to have a better way of accounting for the nature of moral disagreement than the account on offer from ethical subjectivists. The idea, according to the expressivist, is supposed to be that a moral disagreement is ultimately just a disagreement in non-cognitive attitudes. Rather than expressing propositions about their opposing attitudes—which, we saw earlier, would be perfectly compatible with each other—the two disagreeing parties directly express those opposing non-cognitive attitudes. But then, in our discussion of the puzzle about negation, we saw that the expressivist may actually owe us more than this. Specifically, she owes us an explanation of what, exactly, those opposing attitudes are supposed to be. If Jones claims that lying is wrong, and Smith claims that it is not wrong, then Jones and Smith are engaged in a moral disagreement about lying. The expressivist, presumably, will say that Jones expresses something like disapproval of lying. But then what is the state that is directly expressed by Smith’s claim, such that it is disagrees, or is incompatible, with Jones’ disapproval?

According to the Moral Attitude Problem, the issue actually runs deeper than this, for there are more constraints on the expressivist’s answer than just that the state expressed by Smith be something incompatible with Jones’ disapproval of lying. In fact, Jones’ disapproval of lying may turn out to be no less mysterious than whatever sort of state is supposed to be expressed by Smith. After all, we disapprove of all sorts of things. Suppose that Jones also disapproves of Quentin Tarantino movies, but Smith does not. Presumably, this would not count as a moral disagreement, despite the fact that Jones and Smith are expressing mental states similar to those expressed in their disagreement about lying. So what is it, according to ethical expressivism, that makes the one disagreement, and not the other, a moral disagreement? This is especially puzzling given that expressivists often clarify their view by saying that moral disagreements are more like aesthetic disagreements, like a disagreement over Tarantino films; than they are like disagreements over facts, such as whether or not it is snowing.

So the Moral Attitude Problem, basically, is the problem of specifying the exact type, or types, of attitude expressed by ethical claims, such that someone expressing the relevant state counts as making an ethical claim—as opposed to an aesthetic claim, or something else entirely. Judith Thomson raises something like the Moral Attitude Problem when she writes,

The [ethical expressivist] needs to avail himself of a special kind of approval and disapproval: these have to be moral approval and moral disapproval.  For presumably he does not wish to say that believing Alice ought to do a thing is having toward her doing it the same attitude of approval that I have toward the sound of her splendid new violin. (Thomson 1996, p.110)

And several years later, in a paper entitled “Some Not-Much-Discussed Problems for Non-Cognitivism in Ethics,” Michael Smith raises the same problem:

[Ethical expressivists] insist that it is analytic that when people sincerely make normative claims they thereby express desires or aversions.  But which desires and aversions … , and what special feature do they possess that makes them especially suitable for expression in a normative claim? (Smith 2001, p.107)

But it is only very recently that expressivists and their opponents have begun to give the Moral Attitude Problem the attention that it deserves (see Merli 2008; Kauppinen 2010; Köhler 2013; Miller 2013, pp.39-47, pp.81-87; and Björnsson and McPherson 2014)

What can the expressivist say in response? For starters, expressivists can, and should, point out that the Moral Attitude Problem is not unique to their view. Indeed, those who think that ethical claims express cognitive states, like beliefs—namely, ethical cognitivists—face a very similar challenge: Jones believes both that lying is wrong and that Quentin Tarantino movies are bad, but only one of these counts as a moral belief; what is it, exactly, that distinguishes the moral from the non-moral belief? Cognitivists will say that the one belief has a moral proposition as its content, whereas the other belief does not. But that just pushes the question back a step: what, now, is it that distinguishes the moral from the non-moral proposition? Whether it be a matter of spelling out the difference between moral and non-moral beliefs, or that between moral and non-moral propositions, cognitivists are no less burdened to give an account of the nature of moral thinking than are ethical expressivists.

In fact, Köhler argues that expressivists can actually take what are essentially the same routes in response to the Moral Attitude Problem as those taken by cognitivists. Cognitivists, he thinks, have just two options: they can either (a) characterize the nature of moral thinking by reference to some realm of sui generis moral facts which, when they are the objects of beliefs, make those beliefs moral beliefs, or else (b) do the same, but without positing a realm of sui generis moral facts, and instead identifying moral facts with some set of non-moral facts. Similarly, it seems expressivists have two options: they can either (a) say that “the moral attitude” is some sui generis state of mind, or else (b) insist that “the moral attitude” can be analyzed in terms of non-cognitive mental states with which we are already familiar, like desires and aversions, approval and disapproval, and so forth.

The second of these options for expressivists is certainly the more popular of the two. But according to Köhler, if expressivists are to be successful in taking this approach, they ought to conceive of the identity between “the moral attitude” and other, more familiar non-cognitive states in much the same way that naturalistic moral realists conceive of the identity between moral and non-moral facts—that is, either by insisting that the identity is synthetic a posteriori, as the so-called “Cornell realists” do with moral and non-moral facts, or by insisting that the identity is conceptual, but non-obvious, an approach to conceptual analysis proposed by David Lewis, and recently taken up by a few philosophers from Canberra. Otherwise, if an expressivist is comfortable allowing for a sui generis non-cognitive mental state to hold the place of “the moral attitude,” she should get to work explaining what this state is like. Indeed, Köhler argues that this can be done without violating expressivism’s long-standing commitment to metaphysical naturalism (see Köhler 2013, pp.495-507).

b. Hybrid Theories

Perhaps the most exciting of recent trends in the expressivism literature is the advent of so-called “hybrid” expressivist theories. The idea behind hybrid theories, very basically, is that we might be able to secure all of the advantages of both expressivism and cognitivism by allowing that ethical claims express both non-cognitive and cognitive mental states. Why call them hybrid expressivist views, then, and not hybrid cognitivist views? Recall that the two central theses of ethical expressivism are psychological non-cognitivism—the thesis that ethical claims express mental states that are characteristically non-cognitive—and semantic ideationalism—the thesis that the meanings of ethical claims are to be understood in terms of the mental states that they express. Since neither of these theses state that ethical claims express only non-cognitive states, the hybrid theorist can affirm both of them whole-heartedly. For that reason, hybrid theories are generally considered to be forms of expressivism.

The idea that a single claim might express two distinct mental states is not a new one. Philosophers of language have long thought, for instance, that slurs and pejoratives are capable of doing this. Consider the term “yankee” as used by people living in the American South. In most cases, among Southerners, to call someone a “yankee” is to express a certain sort of negative attitude toward the person. But importantly, the term “yankee” cannot apply to just anyone, rather, it applies only to people who are from the North. Acordingly, when native Southerner Roy says, “Did you hear?  Molly’s dating a yankee!” he expresses both (a) a belief that Molly’s partner is from the North, and (b) a negative attitude toward Molly’s partner. It seems we need to suppose that Roy has and expresses both of these states—one cognitive, the other non-cognitive—in order to make adequate sense of the meaning of his claim. In much the same way, hybrid theorists in metaethics suggest that ethical claims can express both beliefs and attitudes. Indeed, these philosophers often model their theories on an analogy to the nature of slurs and pejoratives (see Hay 2013).

Even within the expressivist tradition, the language of hybridity may be new, but the basic idea is not. Recall from earlier that Hare believed ethical claims have two sorts of meaning: descriptive meaning and prescriptive meaning. To claim that something is “good,” he thinks, is to both (a) say or imply that it has some context-specific set of non-moral properties; this is the claim’s descriptive meaning, and (b) commend the thing in virtue of these properties; this is the claim’s prescriptive meaning. This is not far off from a hybrid view according to which “good”-claims express both (a) a belief that something has some property or properties, and (b) a positive non-cognitive attitude toward the thing. Hare was apparently ahead of his time in this respect. The hybrid movement as it is now known is less than a decade old.

One of the earliest notable hybrid views is Ridge’s “ecumenical expressivism” (see Ridge 2006 and 2007). In its initial form, ecumenical expressivism is the view that ethical claims express two closely related mental states—one a belief, and the other a non-cognitive state like approval or disapproval. Furthermore, as an instance of semantic ideationalism, ecumenical expressivism adds that the literal meanings, or semantic contents, of ethical claims are to be understood solely in terms of these mental states. So, for example, the claim

(3)        Lying is wrong

expresses something like these two states: (a) disapproval of things that have a certain property F, and (b) a belief that lying has property F. Notably, the view allows for a kind of subjectivity to moral judgment, since the nature of property F will differ from person to person. A utilitarian, for instance, might disapprove of behavior that fails to maximize utility; a Kantian might instead disapprove of behavior that disrespects people’s autonomy; and so on and so forth. Furthermore, Ridge’s view is supposed to be able to solve the Frege-Geach Problem by conceiving of logical inference and validity in terms of the relationships that obtain among beliefs.

(4)        If lying is wrong, then getting your little brother to lie is wrong.

According to ecumenical expressivism, complex ethical claims like (4) also express two states: (a) disapproval of things that have a certain property F, and (b) the complex belief that if lying has property F, then getting one’s little brother to lie has property F as well. Coupled with an account of logical validity understood in terms of consistency of beliefs, this looks like a promising way to satisfy Geach’s two challenges. (Ridge has since updated his view so that it is no longer a semantic theory, but rather a meta-semantic theory. Thus, rather than attempting to assign literal meanings to ethical claims, Ridge means only to explain that in virtue of which ethical claims have the meanings that they do. See Ridge 2014.)

The implicature-style views defended by Copp and Finlay also fall within the hybrid camp (Copp 2001, 2009; Finlay 2004, 2005). Coined by philosopher H. Paul Grice, the term “implicature” refers to a semantic phenomenon in which a speaker means or implies one thing, while saying something else. A popular example is that of the professor who writes, “Alex has good handwriting,” in a letter of recommendation. What the professor says is that Alex has good handwriting, but what the professor means or implies is that Alex is not an especially good student. So the claim “Alex has good handwriting” has both a literal content, that Alex has good handwriting, and an implicated content, that Alex is not an especially good student.

In the same way, Copp and Finlay suggest that ethical claims have both literal and implicated contents. Once again:

(3)        Lying is wrong

According to these implicature-style views, someone who sincerely utters (3) thereby communicates two things. First, she either expresses a belief, or asserts a proposition, to the effect that lying is wrong—this is the claim’s literal content. Second, she implies that she has some sort of non-cognitive attitude toward lying—this is the claim’s implicated content. It is in this way that implicature-style views are supposed to capture the virtues of both cognitivism and expressivism. Where Copp and Finlay disagree is over the matter of what it is in virtue of which the non-cognitive attitude is implicated. According to Copp, it is a matter of linguistic conventions that govern ethical discourse; whereas Finlay thinks it is a matter of the dynamics of ethical conversation. So Copp’s view is an instance of conventional implicature, while Finlay’s is an instance of conversational implicature.

There may be yet another way to “go hybrid” with one’s expressivism. Rather than hybridizing the mental state(s) expressed by ethical claims, one might instead hybridize the very notion of expression itself. This is the route taken by defenders of a view known as ‘ethical neo-expressivism’ (Bar-On and Chrisman 2009; Bar-On, Chrisman, and Sias 2014). Ethical neo-expressivism rests upon two very important distinctions. The first is a distinction between two different kinds of expression. When we say that agents express their mental states and that sentences express propositions, we refer not just to two different instances of expression, but more importantly, to two different kinds expression, which are often conflated by expressivists.  To see how the two kinds of expression come apart, consider:

(18)      It is so great to see you!

(19)      I am so glad to see you!

Intuitively, these two sentences have different semantic contents. Setting aside complicated issues related to indexicality, sentence (18) expresses the proposition that it is so great to see you (the addressee), and sentence (19) expresses the proposition that I (the speaker) am so glad to see you (the addressee). However, these two different sentences might nonetheless function as vehicles for expressing the same mental state, that is, I might express my gladness or joy at seeing a friend by uttering either of them. Indeed, I might also do so by hugging my friend, or even just by smiling. Importantly, the neo-expressivist urges, it is not the speaker who expresses this or that proposition, but the sentences. People cannot express propositions, but sentences can, in virtue of being conventional representations of them. However, it is not the sentences that express gladness or joy, but the speaker. Sentences cannot express mental states; they are just strings of words. But people can certainly express their mental states by performing various acts, some of which involve the utterance of sentences. Call the relation between sentences and propositions semantic-expression, or s-expression; and call the relation between agents and their mental states action-expression, or a-expression.

According to neo-expressivists, most ethical expressivists, including most hybrid theorists, conflate these two senses of expression because they fail to adequately recognize a second distinction. Notice that terms like “claim”, “judgment”, and “statement” are ambiguous: they might refer either to an act or to the product of that act. So the term “ethical claim” might refer either to the act of making an ethical claim, or to the product of this act—which, presumably, is a sentence tokened either in thought or in speech. This distinction between ethical claims understood as acts and ethical claims understood as products maps nicely onto the earlier distinction between a- and s-expression. Understood as acts, ethical claims are different from non-ethical claims in that, when making an ethical claim, a speaker a-expresses some non-cognitive attitude. In this way, neo-expressivists can apparently affirm psychological non-cognitivism, and may also have the resources for “saving the differences” between ethical and non-ethical discourse. On the other hand, understood as products—that is, sentences containing ethical terms—ethical claims are just like non-ethical claims in s-expressing propositions, and not necessarily in the deflationary sense of proposition noted above. By allowing that ethical claims express propositions, the neo-expressivist may have all she needs in order to avoid the Continuity Problem.

Now, according to some, semantic ideationalism is essential to expressivism. Gibbard, for instance, writes, “The term ‘expressivism’ I mean to cover any account of meanings that follow this indirect path: to explain the meaning of a term, explain what states of mind the term can be used to express” (2003, p.7). However, ethical neo-expressivism, as we have just seen, rejects semantic ideationalism in favor of the more traditional propositional approach to meaning. In light of this, one might legitimately wonder whether neo-expressivism ought to count as an expressivist view. But as Bar-On, Chrisman, and Sias (2014) argue, neo-expressivism is perfectly capable of accommodating both of the main motivations of non-cognitivism and expressivism described in Sections 1 and 3—that is, avoiding a commitment to “spooky,” irreducibly normative properties, and accounting for the close connection between sincere ethical claims and motivation.  Besides, as we saw earlier, it looks like the expressivist’s commitment to semantic ideationalism is what got her into trouble with the Continuity Problem in the first place. So even if neo-expressivism represents something of a departure from mainstream expressivist thought, it may nonetheless be a departure worth considering.

c. Recent Work in Empirical Moral Psychology

Expressivists have long recognized that it is possible to make an ethical claim without being in whatever is supposed to be the corresponding non-cognitive mental state. It is possible, for instance, to utter

(3)        Lying is wrong

without, at the same time, disapproving of lying. Maybe the speaker is just reciting a line from a play; or maybe the speaker suffers from a psychological disorder that renders him incapable of ever being in the relevant non-cognitive state, and he is just repeating something that he has heard others say. These are surely possibilities, and expressivists have at times had different things to say about them, and other cases like them. Either way, though, expressivists generally assume that ethical claims are nonetheless tied to non-cognitive states in a way that justifies us in thinking that a speaker of an ethical claim, if she is being sincere, ought to be motivated to act accordingly. This is one of the two main motivations that attract people to theories in the expressivist tradition.

The assumption that sincere ethical claims in ordinary cases are accompanied by non-cognitive states is presumably one that has empirical implications.  If true, for instance, one might expect to find activity in regions of the brain associated with such states as people make ethical claims sincerely. Indeed, this is precisely what researchers in empirical moral psychology have found throughout various studies conducted over the past few decades. From brain scans to behavioral experiments, tests of skin conductance to moral judgment surveys given in disgusting environments, study after study seems to confirm a view that is sometimes called “psychological sentimentalism”—that is, the view that people are prompted to make the ethical claims that they make primarily by their emotional responses to things.

Now, to be sure, the link posited by psychological sentimentalism is a causal one—our emotions cause us to make certain ethical claims—and that is importantly different from the conceptual link that expressivists generally assume exists between non-cognitive states and ethical claims. But expressivists may nonetheless benefit from exploring how recent work in empirical moral psychology can be used to support parts of their view—for example, how it is that the conceptual link is supposed to have come about. If nothing else, expressivists may find significant empirical support for the view, shared by everyone in the tradition since Ayer, that ethical claims are expressions of characteristically non-cognitive states of mind.

6. References and Further Reading

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  • Ayer, A. J. (1946/1952). Language, Truth, and Logic. New York: Dover.
  • Barker, S. (2006). “Truth and the Expressing in Expressivism.” In Horgan, T. and Timmons, M. (eds.). Metaethics after Moore. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Bar-On, D. and M. Chrisman (2009). “Ethical Neo-Expressivism.” In R. Shafer-Landau (ed.). Oxford Studies in Metaethics, Vol. 4. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bar-On, D., M. Chrisman, and J. Sias (2014). “(How) Is Ethical Neo-Expressivism a Hybrid View.” In M. Ridge and G. Fletcher (eds.), Having It Both Ways: Hybrid Theories and Modern Metaethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Björnsson, G. and T. McPherson (2014). “Moral Attitudes for Non-Cognitivists: Solving the Specification Problem,” Mind,
  • Blackburn, S. (1984). Spreading the Word. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Blackburn, S. (1988a). “Attitudes and Contents.” Ethics 98: 501-17.
  • Blackburn, S. (1988b). “Supervenience Revisited.” In G. Sayre-McCord (ed.), Essays on Moral Realism. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Blackburn, S. (1998). Ruling Passions. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Boisvert, D. (2008). “Expressive-Assertivism.” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 89(2): 169-203.
  • Boyd, R. (1988). “How to Be a Moral Realist.” In G. Sayre-McCord (ed.), Essays on Moral Realism. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Brink, D. (1989). Moral Realism and the Foundations of Ethics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Chrisman, M. (2008). “Expressivism, Inferentialism, and Saving the Debate.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 77: 334-358.
  • Chrisman, M. (2012). “Epistemic Expressivism.” Philosophy Compass 7(2): 118-126.
  • Copp, D. (2001). “Realist-Expressivism: A Neglected Option for Moral Realism.” Social Philosophy and Policy 18(2): 1-43.
  • Copp, D. (2009). “Realist-Expressivism and Conventional Implicature.” In Shafer-Landau, R. (ed.). Oxford Studies in Metaethics, Vol. 4. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Coventry, A. (2006). Hume’s Theory of Causation: A Quasi-Realist Interpretation. London: Continuum.
  • Divers, J. and A. Miller (1994). “Why Expressivists About Value Should Not Love Minimalism About Truth.” Analysis 54: 12-19.
  • Dreier, J. (2004). “Meta-Ethics and the Problem of Creeping Minimalism.” Philosophical Perspectives 18: 23-44.
  • Dreier, J. (2009). “Relativism (and Expressivism) and the Problem of Disagreement.” Philosophical Perspectives 23: 79-110.
  • Finlay, S. (2004). “The Conversational Practicality of Value Judgment.” The Journal of Ethics 8: 205-223.
  • Finlay, S. (2005). “Value and Implicature.” Philosophers’ Imprint 5: 1-20.
  • Geach, P. (1965). “Assertion.” Philosophical Review 74: 449-465.
  • Gert, J. (2002). “Expressivism and Language Learning.” Ethics 112: 292-314.
  • Gibbard, A. (1990). Wise Choices, Apt Feelings. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Gibbard, A. (2003). Thinking How to Live. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Greene, J. D. (2008). “The Secret Joke of Kant’s Soul.” In Walter Sinnott-Armstrong (ed.), Moral Psychology, Vol. 3: The Neuroscience of Morality: Emotion, Brain Disorders, and Development. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, pp. 35-79.
  • Greene, J. D. and J. Haidt (2002). “How (and Where) Does Moral Judgment Work?” Trends in Cognitive Sciences 6: 517-523.
  • Haidt, J. (2001). “The Emotional Dog and Its Rational Tail: A Social Intuitionist Approach to Moral Judgment.” Psychological Review 108(4): 814-834.
  • Hare, R. M. (1952). The Language of Morals. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hare, R. M. (1970). “Meaning and Speech Acts.” The Philosophical Review 79: 3-24.
  • Hay, Ryan. (2013). “Hybrid Expressivism and the Analogy between Pejoratives and Moral Language.” European Journal of Philosophy 21(3): 450-474.
  • Horwich, P. (1998). Truth. Second Edition. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Jackson, F. (1998). From Metaphysics to Ethics. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Jackson, F. and P. Pettit (1995). “Moral Functionalism and Moral Motivation.” Philosophical Quarterly 45: 20-40.
  • Kauppinen, A. (2010). “What Makes a Sentiment Moral?” In R. Shafer-Landau (ed.), Oxford Studies in Metaethics, Vol. 5. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Köhler, S. (2013). “Do Expressivists Have an Attitude Problem?” Ethics 123(3): 479-507.
  • Lewis, D. (1970). “How to Define Theoretical Terms.” Journal of Philosophy 67: 427-446.
  • Lewis, D. (1972). “Psychophysical and Theoretical Identifications.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 50: 249-258.
  • Mackie, J. L. (1977). Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong. London: Penguin.
  • Merli, D. (2008). “Expressivism and the Limits of Moral Disagreement.” Journal of Ethics 12: 25-55.
  • Miller, A. (2013). Contemporary Metaethics: An Introduction. Second Edition. Cambridge: Polity.
  • Moore, G. E. (1903). Principia Ethica. New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Nichols, S. (2004). Sentimental Rules: On the Natural Foundations of Moral Judgment. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Ogden, C. K. and I. A. Richards (1923). The Meaning of Meaning. New York: Harcourt Brace & Jovanovich.
  • Price, H. (2011). “Expressivism for Two Voices.” In J. Knowles and H. Rydenfelt (eds.). Pragmatism, Science, and Naturalism. Peter Lang.
  • Prinz, J. (2006). “The Emotional Basis of Moral Judgments.” Philosophical Explorations 9(1): 29-43.
  • Ramsey, F. P. (1927). “Facts and Propositions.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 7 (Supplementary): 153-170.
  • Ridge, M. (2006). “Ecumenical Expressivism: Finessing Frege.” Ethics 116: 302-336.
  • Ridge, M. (2007). “Ecumenical Expressivism: The Best of Both Worlds?” In Shafer-Landau, R. (ed.). Oxford Studies in Metaethics, Vol. 2. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ridge, M. (2014). Impassioned Belief. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ridge, M. and G. Fletcher, eds. (2014). Having It Both Ways: Hybrid Theories and Modern Metaethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Schroeder, M. (2008a). Being For: Evaluating the Semantic Program of Expressivism. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Schroeder, M. (2008b). “Expression for Expressivists.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 76(1): 86-116.
  • Schroeder, M. (2008c). “How Expressivists Can and Should Solve Their Problem with Negation.” Noûs 42(4): 573-599.
  • Schroeder, M. (2008d). “What is the Frege-Geach Problem?” Philosophy Compass 3(4): 703-720.
  • Schroeder, M. (2009). “Hybrid Expressivism: Virtues and Vices.” Ethics 119(2): 257-309.
  • Searle, J. (1962). “Meaning and Speech Acts.” Philosophical Review 71 (1962): 423-32.
  • Searle, J. (1969). Speech Acts: An Essay in the Philosophy of Language. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Smith, M. (1994a). The Moral Problem. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Smith, M. (1994b). “Why Expressivists About Value Should Love Minimalism About Truth.” Analysis 54: 1-12.
  • Smith, M. (2001). “Some Not-Much-Discussed Problems for Non-Cognitivism in Ethics.” Ratio 14: 93-115.
  • Stevenson, C. L. (1937). “The Emotive Meaning of Ethical Terms.” Mind 46: 14-31.
  • Stevenson, C. L. (1944). Ethics and Language. New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Strawson, P. F. (1949). “Truth.” Analysis 9: 83-97.
  • Thomson, J. (1996). “Moral Objectivity.” In G. Harman and J. Thomson, Moral Relativism and Moral Objectivity (Great Debates in Philosophy). Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Unwin, N. (1999). “Quasi-Realism, Negation and the Frege-Geach Problem.” Philosophical Quarterly 49: 337-352.
  • Unwin, N. (2001). “Norms and Negation: A Problem for Gibbard’s Logic.” Philosophical Quarterly 51: 60-75.
  • Yalcin, S. (2012). “Bayesian Expressivism.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society CXII(2): 123-160.

Author Information

James Sias
Dickinson College
U. S. A.

Alasdair Chalmers MacIntyre (1929— )

MacIntyreAlasdair MacIntyre is a Scottish born, British educated, moral and political philosopher who has worked in the United States since 1970.  His work in ethics and politics reaches across disciplines, drawing on sociology and philosophy of the social sciences as well as Greek and Latin classical literature.

MacIntyre began his career as a Marxist, but in the late 1950s, he started working to develop a Marxist ethics that could rationally justify the moral condemnation of Stalinism.  That project eventually led him to reject Marxism along with every other form of “modern liberal individualism” and to propose Aristotle’s ethics as a more effective way to renew moral agency and practical rationality through small-scale moral formation within communities.

MacIntyre’s best known book, After Virtue (1981), is the product of this long ethical project.  After Virtue diagnoses contemporary society as a “culture of emotivism” in which moral language is used pragmatically to manipulate attitudes, choices, and decisions, so that contemporary moral culture is a theater of illusions in which objective moral rhetoric masks arbitrary choices.  MacIntyre followed After Virtue with two books examining the role that traditions play in judgments about truth and falsity, Whose Justice? Which Rationality? (1988) and Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry (1990).  MacIntyre’s next major work, Dependent Rational Animals: Why Human Beings Need the Virtues (1999), investigates the social needs and social debts of human agents, and the role that a community plays in the formation of an independent practical reasoner.  The remainder of MacIntyre’s mature work extends and supplements the arguments of these four major works.

MacIntyre’s philosophy is important to the fields of virtue ethics and communitarian politics, but MacIntyre has denied belonging to either school of thought.  MacIntyre has identified himself as a Thomist since 1984, but some Thomists question his Thomism because he emphasizes Thomas Aquinas’s treatment of human agency but rejects the neo-Thomist project of a creating a Thomist moral epistemology based on the metaphysics of human nature.  MacIntyre continues to point out the irrelevance of conventional business ethics, conceived as an application of modern moral theories to business decision making, but some scholars in the field of business ethics have begun to apply MacIntyre’s Aristotelian account of agency and virtue to the study of organizational systems, to develop ways of renewing moral agency and practical rationality within companies. MacIntyre has played an important role in the renewal of Aristotelian ethics and politics in the last three decades, and has made a valued contribution to the advancement of Thomistic philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Prefatory Comment on "Modern Liberal Individualism"
  3. Development since 1951
    1. The influence of Marx's Theses on Feuerbach in MacIntyre's Moral and Political Work
    2. Three Phases in MacIntyre's Career
      1. Early Career (1949-1971)
        1. Philosophy of Religion
        2. Philosophy of the Social Sciences
        3. Ethics and Politics
      2. Interim (1971-1977)
      3. Mature Work (1977- )
  4. Major works since 1977
    1. After Virtue
      1. Critical Argument of AV
      2. The Constructive Argument of AV
      3. Aristotelian Critique of Modern Ethics and Politics
      4. Criticism of AV
    2. Two Books on Rationality: WJWR and 3RV
      1. Whose Justice? Which Rationality?
      2. Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry
    3. Dependent Rational Animals
    4. The Tasks of Philosophy: Selected Essays, Volume 1
    5. Ethics and Politics: Selected Essays, Volume 2
    6. God, Philosophy, Universities
  5. The Main Themes of MacIntyre's Philosophy
    1. The Ethics and Politics of Human Agency
    2. Ethics and Politics
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Works
    2. Secondary Works

1. Life

Alasdair MacIntyre was born January 12, 1929 in Glasgow, Scotland.  His parents, both of which were physicians, were born and raised in the West of Scotland.  Though Educated in England, he learned Scots Gaelic from one of his aunts.  MacIntyre grew up in and around the city of London. He earned a bachelor’s degree in classics from Queen Mary College in the University of London in the city’s East End in 1949. MacIntyre attended graduate school at Manchester University, a provincial “red brick” university in the North West of England, earning his MA in Philosophy in 1951.

MacIntyre’s family had distant ties to County Donegal, in the North of Ireland, and his knowledge of Gaelic helped MacIntyre to make connections to the people there. He has remained close to the cultural and political concerns of Ireland for many years. MacIntyre “has an intimate and extensive knowledge of Irish literature, both in English and in Irish” (O’Rourke, p. 3). An academic conference celebrating MacIntyre’s eightieth birthday, held at the University College Dublin in 2009, acknowledged and celebrated his ties to the Irish community.

Alasdair MacIntyre’s philosophy builds on an unusual foundation. His early life was shaped by two conflicting systems of values. One was “a Gaelic oral culture of farmers and fishermen, poets and storytellers.” The other was modernity, “The modern world was a culture of theories rather than stories” (MacIntyre Reader, p. 255). MacIntyre embraced both value systems, and carried those divergent worldviews into his undergraduate education.

As a classics major at Queen Mary College in the University of London (1945-1949), MacIntyre read the Greek texts of Plato and Aristotle, but his studies were not limited to the grammars of ancient languages. He also examined the ethical theories of Immanuel Kant and John Stuart Mill. He attended the lectures of analytic philosopher A. J. Ayer and of philosopher of science Karl Popper. He read Ludwig Wittgenstein’s Tractatus Logico Philosophicus, Jean-Paul Sartre’s L'existentialisme est un humanisme, and Marx’s Eighteenth Brumaire of Napoleon Bonaparte (What happened, pp. 17-18). MacIntyre met the sociologist Franz Steiner, who helped direct him toward approaching moralities substantively (interview with Giovanna Borradori, p. 259). MacIntyre’s mature work continues to bridge across conventional disciplinary borders.

MacIntyre’s mature writings also continue to criticize the social and economic orders of modern life. This work also began during his time at Queen Mary College, growing out of his solidarity with the poor and working classes who filled the East End of London where Queen Mary College is located. MacIntyre’s first encounter with the Marxist critiques of liberalism and capitalism (Kinesis Interview,  p. 48) drew MacIntyre into two decades of participation in Marxist organizations (Alasdair MacIntyre's Engagement with Marxism, pp. xiii-l). MacIntyre’s first encounter with the Thomist critique of English social and political life made a strong impression on MacIntyre, but he would not identify himself as a Thomist until 1984 (What happened, p. 17).

From Marxism, MacIntyre learned to see liberalism as a destructive ideology that undermines communities in the name of individual liberty and consequently undermines the moral formation of human agents (interview with Giovanna Borradori, p. 258; Kinesis Interview , p. 47). MacIntyre still acknowledges the insights of The Eighteenth Brumaire of Napoleon Bonaparte (What happened, pp. 20, 483), a book that strips the ideological pretensions from mid-nineteenth century French political rhetoric. For MacIntyre, Marx’s way of seeing through the empty justifications of arbitrary choices to consider the real goals and consequences of political actions in economic and social terms would remain the principal insight of Marxism. MacIntyre found the predictive theories of Marxist social science less convincing. His first book, Marxism: An Interpretation, (1953), criticizes Marx’s turn to social science; similar critiques appear in nearly all of MacIntyre’s major works.

MacIntyre began his teaching career at the University of Manchester as a Lecturer in the Philosophy of Religion in 1951, and held that post until 1957. In a 1956 essay, “Manchester: The Modern University and the English Tradition,” MacIntyre writes with pride about the role of the provincial universities as centers of professional education that are tied in service to the people of their cities, as places that had traditionally been homes to radical politics and non-conformist and minority (Agnostic, Roman Catholic, and Jewish) religion. Marxism: An Interpretation, is similarly an expression of radical politics and non-conformist religion directed to the service of people’s needs. After Manchester, MacIntyre became a member of Britain’s New Left (Alasdair MacIntyre's Engagement with Marxism, pp. xxii-xxxii, 86-93) and moved through teaching, research, and administrative positions at other British universities before emigrating from Britain to the United States in 1970, where his research interests drew him to teaching posts at Brandeis, Boston University, Vanderbilt, Notre Dame, and Duke. MacIntyre returned to Notre Dame in 2000 as the Senior Research Professor in the Notre Dame Center for Ethics and Culture until his retirement in 2010.

MacIntyre began his career as a Marxist Protestant Christian philosopher of religion, basing his work on the fideism of Karl Barth and Wittgenstein’s concept of a form of life (interview with Giovanna Borradori, p. 257). By 1960 he had stopped writing on that subject, and he wrote as an atheist through the sixties and seventies. MacIntyre’s emigration from Great Britain roughly coincides with his break from organized Marxism. In 1968, MacIntyre published a heavily revised version of Marxism: An Interpretation as Marxism and Christianity, and noted in the preface to the new book that he had become skeptical of both. That skepticism remains in Against the Self-Images of the Age (1971).

During the years 1977 through 1984 MacIntyre transitioned to an Aristotelian worldview, returned to the Christian faith and turned from Aristotle to Thomas Aquinas. MacIntyre explains in the preface to The Tasks of Philosophy (2006) that the article “Epistemological Crises, Dramatic Narrative, and the Philosophy of Science” (hereafter EC, 1977) marks the beginning of this transition.

After his retirement from teaching, MacIntyre has continued his work of promoting a renewal of human agency through an examination of the virtues demanded by practices, integrated human lives, and responsible engagement with community life. He is currently affiliated with the Centre for Contemporary Aristotelian Studies in Ethics and Politics (CASEP) at London Metropolitan University.

Alasdair MacIntyre has authored 19 books and edited five others. His most important book, After Virtue (hereafter AV, 1981), has been called one of the most influential works of moral philosophy of the late 20th century. AV and his other major works, including Marxism: An Interpretation (hereafter MI, 1953), A Short History of Ethics (hereafter SHE, 1966), Marxism and Christianity (hereafter M&C, 1968), Against the Self-Images of the Age (hereafter ASIA, 1971), Whose Justice? Which Rationality? (hereafter WJWR, 1988), Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry (hereafter 3RV, 1990), and Dependent Rational Animals (Hereafter DRA, 1999) have shaped academic moral philosophy for six decades.  SHE served as a standard text for college courses in the history of moral philosophy for many years; AV remains a widely used ethics textbook in undergraduate and graduate education. MacIntyre has published about two hundred journal articles and roughly one hundred book reviews, addressing concerns in ethics, politics, the philosophy of the social sciences, Marxist theory, Marxist political practice, the Aristotelian notion of excellence or virtue in human agency, and the interpretation of Thomistic metaphysics, epistemology, and ethics.

MacIntyre’s mature work, initiated by the 1977 essay, “Epistemological Crises, Dramatic Narrative, and the Philosophy of Science” (hereafter EC), draws upon the study of traditions, and the examination of the narratives that inform traditions of scientific, philosophical, and social practice, as a philosophical method. AV and the whole body of work that follows it employ this philosophical method in the study of moral and political philosophy.

2. Prefatory Comment on "Modern Liberal Individualism"

AV rejects the view of “modern liberal individualism” in which autonomous individuals use abstract moral principles to determine what they ought to do. The critique of modern normative ethics in the first half of AV rejects modern moral reasoning for its failure to justify its premises, and criticizes the frequent use of the rhetoric of objective morality and scientific necessity to manipulate people to accept arbitrary decisions. The critical argument gives examples of such manipulative moral rhetoric in ordinary speech, in philosophical ethics, and in the political use of the social sciences. The second half of AV proposes a conception of practice and practical reasoning and the notion of excellence as a human agent as an alternative to modern moral philosophy, presenting what MacIntyre has called “an historicist defense of Aristotle” (AV, p. 277).

MacIntyre’s use of the term “modern liberal individualism” in philosophy is not equivalent to “liberalism” in contemporary politics. Some readers interpreted MacIntyre’s rejection of “modern liberal individualism” to mean that he is a political conservative (AV, 3rd ed., p. xv), but MacIntyre uses “modern liberal individualism” to name a much broader category that includes both liberals and conservatives in contemporary American political parlance, as well as some Marxists and anarchists (See ASIA, pp. 280-284). Conservatism, liberalism, Marxism, and anarchism all present the autonomous individual as the unit of civil society (see “The Theses on Feuerbach: A Road Not Taken.”); none of these political theories can provide a well-developed conception of the common good; and none of them can adequately explain or justify any shared pursuit of any common good.

The sources of modern liberal individualism—Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau—assert that human life is solitary by nature and social by habituation and convention. MacIntyre’s Aristotelian tradition holds, on the contrary, that human life is social by nature. Modern liberal individualism seeks to justify the moral authority of various universal, impersonal moral principles to enable autonomous individuals to make morally correct decisions. But modern moral philosophers use those principles to establish the authority of universal moral norms, and modern autonomous individuals set aside the pursuit of their own goods and goals when they obey these principles and norms in order to judge and act morally. MacIntyre rejects this modern project as incoherent. MacIntyre identifies moral excellence with effective human agency, and seeks a political environment that will help to liberate human agents to recognize and seek their own goods, as components of the common goods of their communities, more effectively. For MacIntyre therefore, ethics and politics are bound together.

3. Development since 1951

Alasdair MacIntyre’s career in moral and political philosophy has passed through many changes, but two themes have remained constant. The first is his critique of modern normative ethics. The second is his approach to moral philosophy as a study of moral formation that strengthens rational human agency and helps to develop a political community of rational agents. The critique of modern normative ethics draws on two sources, the philosophy of Karl Marx, and the emotivism of early twentieth-century logical positivists, including A. J. Ayer and C. L. Stevenson. The search for a truthful ethics and politics of agents in communities draws on action theory, sociology, the philosophy of science and the theme of “revolutionary practice” drawn from Karl Marx’s Theses on Feuerbach.

a. The influence of Marx's Theses on Feuerbach in MacIntyre's Moral and Political Work

MacIntyre has cited the third of Marx’s Theses on Feuerbach, throughout his career (See MI, p. 61; M&C, p. 59, AV, p. 84); he explains the significance of the Theses on Feuerbach in detail in “The Theses on Feuerbach: A Road Not Taken” (hereafter ToF:RNT), published in 1994. Macintyre reads The Theses on Feuerbach as “a genuinely transitional text” (ToF:RNT, p. 224),” marking the end of Marx’s philosophical work with Hegel and Feuerbach, but “pointing in a direction which Marx did not in fact take” (ToF:RNT, p. 226). Hegel and Feuerbach had been critics of “the standpoint of civil society”; which is effectively the standpoint of “modern liberal individualism.” Feuerbach had criticized objects of religious belief as projections of human thought. But Marx found that the theoretical objects of Feuerbach’s philosophy were susceptible to the same critique. In the Theses on Feuerbach, Marx proposed a philosophy that sets aside the contemplation of theoretical objects in order to examine and transform human activity and practice (ToF:RNT, pp. 227-8; see Marx, fourth and first theses).

In the third thesis, Marx complained that Feuerbach and other materialist social theorists invented a determinist theory of human behavior, but applied it as if it did not encompass their own free agency, as if they were superior to society (ToF:RNT, p. 229-30; see also AV, p. 84).  Rejecting this implicit distinction between society and those superior to it, Marx insisted that the leaders and followers of the revolution can only act together, discovering together the ends and methods of the revolution (ToF:RNT, p. 230-1). Marx made this proposal, but did not pursue it. Later Marxist revivals of philosophy have followed two main roads of research, “the dialectical and historical materialism of Plekhanov . . . or . . . the rational voluntarism of the young Lukács” (ToF:RNT, p. 232). For MacIntyre, even at the beginning of his career, The Theses on Feuerbach offered a less traveled road for the recovery of Marxist philosophy that would become essential to MacIntyre’s contributions to moral and political philosophy.

b. Three Phases in MacIntyre's Career

Discussing his career in an interview for the journal Cogito in 1991, MacIntyre identified three distinct phases in his development. During the first period, from 1949 to 1971, MacIntyre published in the philosophy of religion, ethics, the philosophy of the social sciences, and Marxist political and ethical theory without integrating these studies into a unified world view. During the second period, from 1971 to 1977, MacIntyre worked toward the integration of his philosophy. In the third period, from 1977 forward, MacIntyre has been working on “a single project, to which AV, WJWR and 3RV are all central” (Interview for Cogito, in The MacIntyre Reader, p. 269)

i. Early Career (1949-1971)

In his early career, MacIntyre investigated the rational justification of theories and beliefs, and published books and articles in the philosophy of religion, the philosophy of the social sciences, and moral theory. This survey of his early career will take each of these fields in turn.

1. Philosophy of Religion

In the philosophy of religion, the young MacIntyre did not try to justify religious belief rationally; rather he tried to show that religious belief should be exempted from rational examination. The theory he developed in the 1950s was a defensive structure devised to separate MacIntyre’s religious beliefs from the rest of his academic work. MacIntyre’s early fideist philosophy of religion was influenced by the philosophy of Ludwig Wittgenstein and the theology of Karl Barth. For the fideist, religious belief is not, and cannot be rational; its only basis is the acceptance of religious authority. MacIntyre’s Barthian-Wittgensteinian philosophy of religion is nothing more than a rational compartmentalization of religious belief.

The key statement of MacIntyre’s early fideist philosophy of religion is his 1957 essay, “The Logical Status of Religious Belief,” published in the book Metaphysical Beliefs. This essay faced strong criticism from the atheist Antony Flew and the Christian theologian Basil Mitchell. In a 1958 book review, Flew pointed out that traditional Christianity had a closer connection to empirical facts than MacIntyre allowed, and that even if facts about the world could not verify religious belief, it was nonetheless possible for internal incoherence to demonstrate the falsehood of doctrine. Mitchell published a fourteen page critique of MacIntyre’s fideism in 1961 entitled, “The Justification of Religious Belief.” When Metaphysical Beliefs was republished in 1970, MacIntyre added a new preface in which he thanked Flew and Mitchell, along with his colleague Ronald Hepburn, for their criticism, and rejected the essay’s “irrationalism as both false and dangerous” (“Preface to the 1970 Edition,” pp. x–xi).

From the early 1960s through the late 1970s, MacIntyre wrote as an avowed atheist. Three publications in the 1960s, “God and the Theologians,” The Religious Significance of Atheism, and Secularization and Moral Change, express MacIntyre’s atheist convictions.

The reasoning behind MacIntyre’s rejection of his early fideism continues to inform his approach to theism. MacIntyre’s 2010 lecture, “On Being a Theistic Philosopher in a Secularized Culture” does not treat theistic belief as an isolable metaphysical doctrine about the origin and fate of human life. For the mature MacIntyre, theism plays a central role in the interpretation of the world. MacIntyre’s mature theism is not a return to his early fideism; it belongs to a rational worldview that challenges “secular fideists” on the same grounds that it challenges religious ones (WJWR, p. 5).

2. Philosophy of the Social Sciences

MacIntyre’s early work in the philosophy of the social sciences is related to the rational justification of Marxist theory, and to distinguishing the more promising elements of Marx’s early philosophical work from the more pseudoscientific elements of later Marxist and Stalinist theory. Within Marxism, which presented itself through most of the twentieth century as a social science, MacIntyre directed his critique against the crude determinism of Stalinism. More broadly, MacIntyre has questioned the rational justification of any social theory that does not give a central place to the beliefs, intentions, and choices of human agents.

In his unpublished master’s thesis, The Significance of Moral Judgements (hereafter SMJ, 1951), MacIntyre cites Steven Toulmin, “The Logical Status of Psycho-Analysis,” Antony Flew, “Psycho-Analytic Explanation,” and Richard Peters, “Cause, Cure, and Motive,” to criticize Sigmund Freud’s apparent reduction of the moral account of a person’s actions to a causal account of that person’s psychological condition.

MacIntyre remained an outspoken critic of determinist social science throughout the early period of his career. Marxism: An Interpretation criticizes Marx’s turn to determinist social science in The German Ideology (MI, pp. 68-78). M&C, revises this criticism, directing the blame toward Friedrich Engels (M&C, pp.70-74). In the article, “Determinism,” MacIntyre admitted that successful predictions about human behavior from the social sciences made it difficult to dismiss determinism, but given the kinds of interpretative choices required to defend determinism, he found “it difficult to see how determinism could ever be verified or falsified” (pp. 39-40).

3. Ethics and Politics

MacIntyre’s critique of modern normative ethics, if understood as a critique of the normative ethics characteristic of liberal modernity, is rooted partly in the work of Karl Marx. While still a student, MacIntyre had accepted much of the Marxist critique of modern liberal politics as an ideology that sets the individual against the interests of the community. Marx dismissed the notion of “natural rights” as a residue of feudal society in the book review, “On The Jewish Question.” For Marx, “rights” could arise only from laws made by governments. Marx held that “natural rights” or the “rights of man,” as used in nineteenth century liberal politics, served only to protect the individual from the society to which he belonged, and thus threatened both the society and the individual.

MacIntyre’s early Marxism led him to reject every form of modern liberal individualism, “including the liberalism of contemporary American and English conservatives, as well as that of American and European radicals, and even the liberalism of the self-proclaimed liberals.” For these ideological stances, by their constructions of civil society as a response of the individual to universal standards of reason and behavior, “impose a certain kind of unacknowledged domination, and one which in the long run tends to dissolve traditional human ties and to impoverish social and cultural relationships” (Borradori interview, p. 258)

MacIntyre’s critique of modern normative ethics is also influenced by the theory of emotivism. C. L. Stevenson and other emotivists held that moral judgments signify only the subjective interests of their authors, rather than any objective characteristic of the agents and actions they judge. SMJ takes issue with the reductivism of Stevenson’s theory of the meaning of moral judgments, but MacIntyre agrees with most points of Stevenson’s emotivist critique of modern normative ethics, and in this way MacIntyre joins Stevenson’s critique of the intuitionism of G. E. Moore.

Moore had argued in Principia Ethica (1903) that the fundamental task of philosophical ethics was to investigate “assertions about that property of things which is denoted by the term ‘good,’ and the converse property denoted by the term ‘bad’” (Principia Ethica, §23) Moore asserted that “good” must name some specific quality that all good things share, but he found it impossible to define “good” in any adequate way (Principia Ethica, §10). Moore therefore described “good” as a simple, indefinable, non-natural quality.

Logical positivists, including A. J. Ayer (Language Truth and Logic, ch. 6) and C. L. Stevenson could find nothing objective in the “good” that Moore described, and concluded that “good” and “bad” are not objective qualities. Stevenson held that valuations, like “this is a good car” or “that is a good house,” and moral valuations, like “he is a good man,” or “theft is wrong,” are not statements of fact. For Stevenson, evaluative words like “good” and “evil” carry, “emotive meaning” which Stevenson defines as “a tendency of a word, arising through the history of its usage, to produce (result from) affective responses to people” (“The Emotive Meaning of Ethical Terms” p. 23) Emotive terms are used to influence people. Thus the true meaning of any valuation, and particularly of any moral valuation—the significance of moral judgments—is either the speaker’s subjective approval and recommendation, or the speaker’s subjective rejection and proscription. In short, the emotivists held that moral judgments communicate neither facts nor beliefs; they communicate only the emotional interests of their authors.

MacIntyre criticized the reductivism of Stevenson’s conclusions in his MA thesis, but MacIntyre did not criticize Stevenson’s rejection of Moore. MacIntyre explains, “This is not to deny the emotive character of the moral judgment: it is to suggest that when we have said of moral judgments that they are emotive we have left a great deal unsaid—and even the emotive may have a logic to be mapped” (SMJ, p. 89.) MacIntyre’s 1951 assessment of emotivism accepts Stevenson’s critique of the referential meaning of moral judgments (SMJ, p. 74), and with it, the general rejection of “traditional moral philosophy” as a study that uses principles to assess facts (SMJ, p. 81).

For MacIntyre ethics is not an application of principles to facts, but a study of moral action. Moral action, free human action, involves decisions to do things in pursuit of goals, and it involves the understanding of the implications of one’s actions for the whole variety of goals that human agents seek. In this sense, “To act morally is to know how to act” (SMJ, p. 56). “Morality is not a ‘knowing that’ but a ‘knowing how’” (SMJ, p. 89). If human action is a ‘knowing how,’ then ethics must also consider how one learns ‘how.’ Like other forms of ‘knowing how,’ MacIntyre finds that one learns how to act morally within a community whose language and shared standards shape our judgment (SMJ, pp. 68-72). MacIntyre had concluded that ethics is not an abstract exercise in the assessment of facts; it is a study of free human action and of the conditions that enable rational human agency.

Human agency remains a central theme in MacIntyre’s first published book, Marxism: An Interpretation (1953). The book praises those forms of M&C that enable human agency, and criticizes those that inhibit human agency. MacIntyre traces a history from Protestant theology and practice, through the philosophies of Hegel and Feuerbach, to the work of Marx to argue that Marxism is a transformation of Christianity. MacIntyre gives Marx credit for concluding in the third of the Theses on Feuerbach, that the only way to change society is to change ourselves, and that “The coincidence of the changing of human activity or self-changing can only be comprehended and rationally understood as revolutionary practice” (Marx, Theses on Feuerbach, quoted in MI, p. 61). MacIntyre criticizes Marx’s subsequent turn to determinist social science and concludes that “Marx’s transition from prophecy to prediction” transforms Marxism into an alienating myth that divides human beings between “the good who accept Marxism, [and] the wicked who reject it” (MI, p. 89).

The book also examines some shortcomings of Protestant theology and practice, showing how the demands of the gospel inform the ideals of Feuerbach and, through Feuerbach, Marx. MacIntyre distinguishes “religion which is an opiate for the people from religion which is not” (MI, p. 83). He condemns forms of religion that justify social inequities and encourage passivity. He argues that authentic Christian teaching criticizes social structures and encourages action (MI, pp. 119-22).

The MA thesis and MI combine to chart MacIntyre’s initial reply to the emotivist critique of modern normative ethics. They also prefigure MacIntyre’s conflict with R. M. Hare’s response to emotivism. Hare sought to defend modern normative ethics from the emotivist challenge with an alternative account of the meaning of moral judgments. A central claim of Hare’s The Language of Morals (1952), renewed in Freedom and Reason (1963), is that moral judgments are descriptive—not merely emotive—because they are both universalizable and prescriptive. For Hare, universalizability stems from an agent’s commitment to use terms and judgments consistently. For example, “If a person says that a thing is red, he is committed to the view that anything which was like it in the relevant respects would likewise be red” (Freedom and Reason, I 2.2). Thus the prescriptive judgments that agents make are universalizable, insofar as those agents are committed to judging similar things similarly; and it is the universalizability of these prescriptive judgments that gives them descriptive meaning. In short, moral judgments are descriptive because they describe the values chosen by their authors.

MacIntyre rejected Hare’s defense of modern normative ethics in his 1957 essay, “What Morality Is Not.” MacIntyre focuses on Hare’s theory: “It is widely held that it is of the essence of moral valuations that they are universalizable and prescriptive. This is the contention which I wish to deny.” “What Morality is Not” explores the variety of meanings and intentions carried by moral judgments. MacIntyre lists six kinds of moral valuations that are neither universalizable nor prescriptive and concludes that the theory of universal prescriptivism is inadequate for the same reason that emotivism is inadequate; it is reductive. Universal prescriptivism simply fails to give a complete account of the meaning of moral judgments.

“What Morality is Not” also argues that the procedures of modern moral philosophy are superfluous to real moral practice. Where “moral philosophy textbooks” discuss the kinds of maxims that should guide “promise-keeping, truth-telling, and the like,” moral maxims do not guide real agents in real life at all. “They do not guide us because we do not need to be guided. We know what to do” (ASIA, p. 106). Sometimes we do this without any maxims at all, or even against all the maxims we know. MacIntyre Illustrates his point with Huckleberry Finn’s decision to help Jim, Miss Watson’s escaped slave, to make his way to freedom (ASIA, p. 107). Once again, morality is not a “knowing that” but a “knowing how,” and the use of this “knowing how” cannot be reduced to making universalizable prescriptive judgments. MacIntyre’s rejection of Hare’s universal prescriptivism renewed his critique of modern normative ethics, and carried lasting consequences for the Marxist MacIntyre’s response to the moral challenge of Stalinism.

In the late 1950s Marxists throughout the world discovered the hidden atrocities of the Stalinist regime in the Soviet Union, and witnessed the violent suppression of the Hungarian revolution of 1956 (See Virtue and Politics, pp. 134-151). The crimes of the Stalinist regime, including mass murder, mass deportation, and the execution of the intellectual, political, cultural, and ecclesial leadership of subject national communities, demanded condemnation. Yet the moral criticism of Stalinist policies presented a problem to committed Marxist atheists, including MacIntyre, who had rejected theistic notions of divine law as well as modern secular notions of “natural rights.”

MacIntyre discussed the moral condemnation of Stalinism in “Notes from the Moral Wilderness” I & II, (1958 and 59). For MacIntyre, it appeared difficult to condemn Stalinism with any real authority, because any appeal to modern secular liberal moral principle seems to be essentially arbitrary. The ex-communist, liberal critic of Stalinism “can only condemn in the name of his own choice” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 34). MacIntyre’s description of the moral perplexity of these critics of Stalinism resembles his description of Huck Finn a year earlier (ASIA, p. 106); they judged the crimes of Stalin well, but lacked any adequate way to justify their judgments rationally. In “Notes From the Moral Wilderness II,” MacIntyre proposed a new Marxist ethics of human action. Rather than divorcing “the ‘ought’ of morality” from “the ‘is’ of desire” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 41), MacIntyre’s Marxist ethics would look to “the fact of human solidarity which comes to light in the discovery of what we want” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 48).

MacIntyre’s Marxist writings of the early 1960s develop his ethical project. “Communism and British Intellectuals” (1960) argues that the Communist Party of Great Britain is no longer Marxist because it has abandoned Marx’s insight from the third of the Theses on Feuerbach. “Classical Marxism . . . wants to transform the vast mass of mankind from victims and puppets into agents who are masters of their own lives,” but Stalinism had transformed Marxism into the doctrine that scientists should use “the objective and unchangeable laws of history” to manage the behavior of society (Alasdair MacIntyre’s Engagement with Marxism, p. 119). “Freedom and Revolution” (1960) discusses “human initiative” in terms of “desire, intention, and choice” (Alasdair MacIntyre’s Engagement with Marxism, p. 124), and sees the full development of human freedom to require participation in the life of a community: “The problem of freedom is not the problem of the individual against society but the problem of what sort of society we want, and what sort of individuals we want to be” (Alasdair MacIntyre’s Engagement with Marxism, p. 129). The individual should not seek liberation from society, but through society. Morality has to do with one’s participation in the life of one’s community.

MacIntyre develops the ideas that morality emerges from history, and that morality organizes the common life of a community in SHE (1966). The book concludes that the concepts of morality are neither timeless nor ahistorical, and that understanding the historical development of ethical concepts can liberate us “from any false absolutist claims” (SHE, p. 269). Yet this conclusion need not imply that morality is essentially arbitrary or that one could achieve freedom by liberating oneself from the morality of one’s society. In his comments on Plato’s Gorgias in chapter 4, MacIntyre rejects Callicles’ claims that breaking social rules can be liberating. “For a man whose behavior was not rule-governed in any way would have ceased to participate as an intelligible agent in human society” (SHE, p. 32). Elements of SHE return in the histories of AV (1981) and WJWR (1988).

ii. Interim (1971-1977)

The publication of ASIA in 1971 marks the end of the “heterogeneous, badly organized, sometimes fragmented and often frustrating and messy enquiries” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 268) that made up the first part of MacIntyre’s career, and the beginning of “an interim period of sometimes painfully self-critical reflection” that would end with the publication of EC in 1977.

ASIA is a collection of short essays criticizing ideology, contemporary religious practice, Marxist theory and hagiography, modern moral philosophy, reductive approaches to the social sciences, and modern liberal individualism. The essays in the book address most of the issues that would appear a decade later in AV, but they are not synthesized into a single coherent narrative “because,” MacIntyre explains in the preface, “to rescue them from their form as reviews or essays written at a particular time or place would require that I should know how to tie these arguments together into a substantive whole. This I do not yet know how to do. . .” (ASIA, p. x). As MacIntyre himself reports, he spent the interim period from 1971 to 1977 working to bring unity to his philosophical writing (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 268-9). ASIA is a valuable companion to AV because some issues that are treated obscurely in the latter, for example Trotsky’s assessment of the Russian Revolution, are treated in detail in the former (AV, p. 262; ASIA, pp. 52-59).

ASIA’s final essay, “Political and Philosophical Epilogue: A View of The Poverty of Liberalism by Robert Paul Wolff,” introduces some of the most characteristic claims of AV: Various forms of modern liberalism appeal to different theories and principles for their justification. The theories that are used to justify liberal principles may serve as ideological masks that enable “those who profess the principles to deceive not only others but also themselves as to the character of their political action” (ASIA, p. 282). “American conservatism,” “American liberalism,” and “American radicalism” are all forms of modern liberalism, thus “To free ourselves from liberalism, radicalism is the wrong remedy.” Marxism cannot fulfill its promise to teach us how to transform society, but “we can at least learn from it where not to begin” (ASIA, p. 284).

In the Cogito interview, MacIntyre says that by 1971 he had begun to look to Aristotle as the right place to begin to study society in order to understand it and transform it. He “set out to rethink the problems of ethics in a systematic way, taking seriously for the first time the possibility that the history both of modern morality and of modern moral philosophy could only be written adequately from an Aristotelian point of view” (The MacIntyre Reader, p. 268).

For MacIntyre, “an Aristotelian point of view” sees teleology inherent in the natures of things, interprets deliberate human activity as voluntary action—not as caused behavior, and finds the human person to be naturally social. From this “Aristotelian point of view,” “modern morality” begins to go awry when moral norms are separated from the pursuit of human goods and moral behavior is treated as an end in itself. This separation characterizes Christian divine command ethics since the fourteenth century and has remained essential to secularized modern morality since the eighteenth century. From MacIntyre’s “Aristotelian point of view,” the autonomy granted to the human agent by modern moral philosophy breaks down natural human communities and isolates the individual from the kinds of formative relationships that are necessary to shape the agent into an independent practical reasoner.

iii. Mature Work (1977- )

In the Preface to The Tasks of Philosophy (2006), MacIntyre explains that the discontinuities of ASIA left him with the question, “How then was I to proceed philosophically?” MacIntyre’s answer came in the 1977 essay “Epistemological Crises, Dramatic Narrative, and the Philosophy of Science” (Hereafter EC). This essay, MacIntyre reports, “marks a major turning-point in my thought in the 1970s” (The Tasks of Philosophy, p. vii) EC may be described fairly as MacIntyre’s discourse on method, and as the title suggests, it presents three general points on the method for philosophy.

First, Philosophy makes progress through the resolution of problems. These problems arise when the theories, histories, doctrines and other narratives that help us to organize our experience of the world fail us, leaving us in “epistemological crises.” Epistemological crises are the aftermath of events that undermine the ways that we interpret our world. Epistemological crises may be deeply personal, triggered by unexpected betrayal or by the loss of religious faith or ideological commitment, or they may be highly speculative, brought on by the failure of trusted theories to explain our experience. To live in an epistemological crisis is to be aware that one does not know what one thought one knew about some particular subject and to be anxious to recover certainty about that subject.

To resolve an epistemological crisis it is not enough to impose some new way of interpreting our experience, we also need to understand why we were wrong before: “When an epistemological crisis is resolved, it is by the construction of a new narrative which enables the agent to understand both how he or she could intelligibly have held his or her original beliefs and how he or she could have been so drastically misled by them” (EC, in The Tasks of Philosophy, p. 5). The resolution of the crisis may lead one to recognize that human understanding is always incomplete and that progress in enquiry is therefore open ended. For MacIntyre, the resolution of an epistemological crisis cannot promise the neat clarity of a shift from a failed body of theory to a truthful one.

To illustrate his position on the open-endedness of enquiry, MacIntyre compares the title characters of Shakespeare’s Hamlet and Jane Austen’s Emma. When Emma finds that she is deeply misled in her beliefs about the other characters in her story, Mr. Knightly helps her to learn the truth and the story comes to a happy ending (p. 6). Hamlet, by contrast, finds no pat answers to his questions; rival interpretations remain throughout the play, so that directors who would stage the play have to impose their own interpretations on the script (p. 5). MacIntyre notes, “Philosophers have customarily been Emmas and not Hamlets” (p. 6); that is, philosophers have treated their conclusions as accomplished truths, rather than as “more adequate narratives” (p. 7) that remain open to further improvement.

The second point of EC addresses the relationship between narratives, truth, and education. The traditional education of children begins in myth, and as children mature they learn to distinguish the lessons of these stories from the fictional events, the truths from the myths. In the course of this education, however, the student grows to respect the myths as bearers of truth. The student who grows through this kind of education to become a scholar “may become . . . a Vico or a Hamann” (p. 8. Johann Georg Hamaan (1730-1788), Giambattista Vico (1668-1744)). Another approach to education is the method of Descartes, who begins by rejecting everything that is not clearly and distinctly true as unreliable and false in order to rebuild his understanding of the world on a foundation of undeniable truth.

Ironically, in the process of rejecting myth, Descartes creates a narrative that is not only mythical but profoundly false. Rather than identifying specific areas of crisis in which he had lost confidence in his understanding of the world and situating himself within the tradition that has formed his understanding and his enquiry, Descartes presents himself as willfully rejecting everything he had believed, and ignores his obvious debts to the Scholastic tradition, even as he argues his case in French and Latin. For MacIntyre, seeking epistemological certainty through universal doubt as a precondition for enquiry is a mistake: “it is an invitation not to philosophy but to mental breakdown, or rather to philosophy as a means of mental breakdown.” David Hume’s cry of pain in his Treatise of Human Nature is the outcome of this kind of philosophical practice (EC, pp. 10-11). MacIntyre contrasts Descartes’ descent into mythical isolation with Galileo, who was able to make progress in astronomy and physics by struggling with the apparently insoluble questions of late medieval astronomy and physics, and radically reinterpreting the issues that constituted those questions.

To make progress in philosophy one must sort through the narratives that inform one’s understanding, struggle with the questions that those narratives raise, and on occasion, reject, replace, or reinterpret portions of those narratives and propose those changes to the rest of one’s community for assessment. Human enquiry is always situated within the history and life of a community. There is no alternative ahistorical, non-traditional way to make progress in human enquiry. MacIntyre returns to this theme in WJWR (chapters 17, 18, 19), in 3RV, and in his Aquinas Lecture, “First Principles, Final Ends, and Contemporary Philosophical Issues” (1990).

The third point of EC is that we can learn about progress in philosophy from the philosophy of science. In particular, “Kuhn’s work criticized provides an illuminating application for the ideas which I have been defending” (EC, p. 15) Kuhn’s The Structure of Scientific Revolutions had argued that scientists practice normal science according to the norms of paradigms or “disciplinary matrices.” Scientific revolutions occur when scientists abandon one paradigm for another. Kuhn’s “paradigm shifts,” however, are unlike MacIntyre’s resolutions of epistemological crises in two ways. First they are not rational responses to specific problems. Kuhn compares paradigm shifts to religious conversions (pp. 150, 151, 158), stressing that they are not guided by rational norms and he claims that the “mopping up” phase of a paradigm shift is a matter of convention in the training of new scientists and attrition among the holdouts of the previous paradigm (Kuhn, pp. 152, 159). Second, the new paradigm is treated as a closed system of belief that regulates a new period of “normal science”; Kuhn’s revolutionary scientists are Emmas, not Hamlets.

MacIntyre takes Kuhn’s position as a restatement of Michael Polyani’s theory that “reason operates only within traditions and communities,” so that transitions between traditions or reconstructions of failed traditions must be irrational (EC, p. 16).  On Kuhn’s account, “scientific revolutions are epistemological crises understood in a Cartesian way. Everything is put in question simultaneously” (EC, p. 17).

MacIntyre proposes elements of Imre Lakatos’ philosophy of science as correctives to Kuhn’s. While Lakatos has his own shortcomings, his general account of the methodologies of scientific research programs recognizes the role of reason in the transitions between theories and between research programs (Lakatos’ analog to Kuhn’s paradigms or disciplinary matrices). Lakatos presents science as an open ended enquiry, in which every theory may eventually be replaced by more adequate theories. For Lakatos, unlike Kuhn, rational scientific progress occurs when a new theory can account both for the apparent promise and for the actual failure of the theory it replaces. The third conclusion of MacIntyre’s essay is that decisions to support some theories over others may be justified rationally to the extent that those theories allow us to understand our experience and our history, including the history of the failures of inadequate theories. EC answers the question that arose from ASIA of how to proceed philosophically. All of MacIntyre’s mature work uses and develops the methodology presented in this essay.

4. Major works since 1977

a. After Virtue

AV (1981, 2nd ed. 1984, 3rd ed. 2007) applies the methodology of EC to many of the same issues addressed in ASIA and in SHE, but interprets the history of ethics and the failure of modern moral philosophy in Aristotelian terms. For Aristotle, moral philosophy is a study of practical reasoning, and the excellences or virtues that Aristotle recommends in the Nicomachean Ethics are the intellectual and moral excellences that make a moral agent effective as an independent practical reasoner. AV criticizes modern liberal individualism and scientific determinism for separating practical reasoning from morality and political life; it proposes instead a return to Aristotelian ethics and politics.

i. Critical Argument of AV

The critical argument of AV, which makes up the first half of the book, begins by examining the current condition of secular moral and political discourse. MacIntyre finds contending parties defending their decisions by appealing to abstract moral principles, but he finds their appeals eclectic, inconsistent, and incoherent.  MacIntyre also finds that the contending parties have little interest in the rational justification of the principles they use. The language of moral philosophy has become a kind of moral rhetoric to be used to manipulate others in defense of the arbitrary choices of its users. What Stevenson had said incorrectly about the meaning of moral judgments has come to be true of the use of moral judgments. MacIntyre reinterprets “emotivism,” Stevenson’s “false theory of meaning” as a “cogent theory of use,” and he names the culture that uses moral rhetoric pragmatically and syncretically “the culture of emotivism.”

MacIntyre traces the lineage of the culture of emotivism to the secularized Protestant cultures of northern Europe (AV, p. 37). These cultures had abandoned any connection between an agent’s natural telos, personal desires, or pursuit of goods and that same agent’s moral duties when they had adopted the divine command moralities of fourteenth, fifteenth, and sixteenth century Christian moral theology. The secular moral philosophers of the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries shared strong and extensive agreements about the content of morality (AV, p. 51) and believed that their moral philosophy could justify the demands of their morality rationally, free from religious authority.

Modern moral philosophy had thus set for itself an incoherent goal. It was to vindicate both the moral autonomy of the individual and the objectivity, necessity, and categorical character of the rules of morality (AV, p. 62). MacIntyre surveys the best efforts to achieve the goals of modern moral philosophy but dismisses each one as a moral fiction.

Given the failure of modern moral philosophy, MacIntyre turns to an apparent alternative, the pragmatic expertise of professional managers. Managers are expected to appeal to the facts to make their decisions on the objective basis of effectiveness, and their authority to do this is based on their knowledge of the social sciences. An examination of the social sciences reveals, however, that many of the facts to which managers appeal depend on sociological theories that lack scientific status. Thus, the predictions and demands of bureaucratic managers are no less liable to ideological manipulation than the determinations of modern moral philosophers.

If modern morality has been revealed to be “a theater of illusions,” then we must reject it, and this rejection can take two forms. Either we follow Nietzsche and defend the autonomy of the individual against the arbitrary demands of conventional moral reasoning, or we reject both moral autonomy and arbitrary conventional moral reasoning to follow Aristotle and investigate practical reason and the role of moral formation in preparing the human agent to succeed as an independent practical reasoner.

The critical argument of AV raises serious questions about the rational justification of modern moral philosophy, and it also proposes an explanation for the rational failure of modern moral philosophy: Modern moral philosophy separates moral reasoning about duties and obligations from practical reasoning about ends and practical deliberation about the means to one’s ends, and in doing so it separates morality from practice. Kant separates moral and practical reasoning explicitly in The Critique of Pure Reason (Critique of Pure Reason, A800/B828–A819/B847) and in The Foundations of the Metaphysics of Morals (First Section, pp. 393-405.); Mill makes the same separation in Utilitarianism (chapter 2).

MacIntyre compares the separation of morality from practice or the separation of moral reasoning from practical reasoning in modern moral philosophy to the separation of morality from practice in Polynesian taboo. The Polynesians had lost the practical justifications for their well-established moral customs by the time they first made contact with European explorers; so when they told these visitors that certain practices were forbidden because those practices were “taboo,” they were unable to explain why these practices were forbidden or what, precisely, “taboo” meant. Many Europeans also lost the practical justifications for their moral norms as they approached modernity; for these Europeans, claiming that certain practices are “immoral,” and invoking Kant’s categorical imperative or Mill’s principle of utility to explain why those practices are immoral, seems no more adequate than the Polynesian appeal to taboo. The comparison between modern morality and taboo is a recurring theme in MacIntyre’s ethical work.

MacIntyre’s critique of the separation of morality from practice also draws on his criticism of determinist social science. Practice involves free and deliberate human action, while morality divorced from practice regulates only outward human behavior. Determinist social scientists, notably Stalinists but also behaviorists like W.V. Quine, viewed human behaviors as determined responses to various kinds of causal factors, and refused to examine the things people do in terms of “intentions, purposes, and reasons for action” (Quine, quoted in AV, p. 83). Instead, determinist social scientists sought “law-like generalizations” about the connections of these causes to their behavioral effects, which would enable them to predict human behavior, and bring scientific understanding to the work of organizational management (AV, pp. 88–91).

ii. The Constructive Argument of AV

In the second half of AV, MacIntyre explores the moral tradition that examines human judgment, human weakness, and excellence in human action. The constructive argument of the second half of the book begins with traditional accounts of the excellences or virtues of practical reasoning and practical rationality rather than virtues of moral reasoning or morality. These traditional accounts define virtue as arête, as excellence, and all of the definitions offered in the second half of AV describe the excellence of the human agent who judges well and acts effectively in pursuit of desired ends. MacIntyre sifts these definitions and then gives his own definition of virtue, as excellence in human agency, in terms of practices, whole human lives, and traditions in chapters 14 and 15 of AV.

In the most often quoted sentence of AV, MacIntyre defines a practice as (1) a complex social activity that (2) enables participants to gain goods internal to the practice. (3) Participants achieve excellence in practices by gaining the internal goods. When participants achieve excellence, (4) the social understandings of excellence in the practice, of the goods of the practice, and of the possibility of achieving excellence in the practice “are systematically extended” (AV, p. 187).

Practices, like chess, medicine, architecture, mechanical engineering, football, or politics, offer their practitioners a variety of goods both internal and external to these practices. The goods internal to practices include forms of understanding or physical abilities that can be acquired only by pursuing excellence in the associated practice. Goods external to practices include wealth, fame, prestige, and power; there are many ways to gain these external goods. They can be earned or purchased, either honestly or through deception; thus the pursuit of these external goods may conflict with the pursuit of the goods internal to practices.

MacIntyre illustrates the conflict between the pursuits of internal and external goods in the parable of the chess playing child. An intelligent child is given the opportunity to win candy by learning to play chess. As long as the child plays chess only to win candy, he has every reason to cheat if by doing so he can win more candy. If the child begins to desire and pursue the goods internal to chess, however, cheating becomes irrational, because it is impossible to gain the goods internal to chess or any other practice except through an honest pursuit of excellence. Goods external to practices may nevertheless remain tempting to the practitioner.

Practices are supported by institutions like chess clubs, hospitals, universities, industrial corporations, sports leagues, and political organizations. Practices exist in tension with these institutions, since the institutions tend to be oriented to goods external to practices. Universities, hospitals, and scholarly societies may value prestige, profitability, or relations with political interest groups above excellence in the practices they are said to support.

Personal desires and institutional pressures to pursue external goods may threaten to derail practitioners’ pursuits of the goods internal to practices. MacIntyre defines virtue initially as the quality of character that enables an agent to overcome these temptations: “A virtue is an acquired human quality the possession and exercise of which tends to enable us to achieve those goods which are internal to practices and the lack of which effectively prevents us from achieving any such goods” (AV, p. 191).

MacIntyre finds that this first level definition is inadequate to describe an excellent human agent. It is not enough to be an excellent navigator, physician, or builder; the excellent human agent lives an excellent life. Excellence as a human agent cannot be reduced to excellence in a particular practice (See AV, pp. 204–205, and Ethics and Politics, pp. 196–7). MacIntyre therefore adds a second level to his definition of virtue.

The virtues therefore are to be understood as those dispositions which will not only sustain practices and enable us to achieve the goods internal to practices, but which will also sustain us in the relevant kind of quest for the good, by enabling us to overcome the harms, dangers, temptations, and distractions which we encounter, and which will furnish us with increasing self-knowledge and increasing knowledge of the good (AV, p. 219).

The excellent human agent has the moral qualities to seek what is good and best both in practices and in life as a whole.

The second level definition is still inadequate, however, because it does not take into account the individual’s response to the life and legacy of her or his community. MacIntyre rejects individualism and insists that we view human beings as members of communities who bear specific debts and responsibilities because of our social identities. The responsibilities one may inherit as a member of a community include debts to one’s forbearers that one can only repay to people in the present and future. These responsibilities also include debts incurred by the unjust actions of ones’ predecessors.

MacIntyre acknowledges that contemporary individualism insists that “the self is detachable from its social and historical roles and statuses” (AV, p. 221), but he illustrates his counterpoint point with three national communities in which contemporary citizens continue to bear the debts of their predecessors. The enslavement and oppression of black Americans, the subjugation of Ireland, and the genocide of the Jews in Europe remained quite relevant to the responsibilities of citizens of the United States, England, and Germany in 1981, as they still do today.  Thus an American who said “I never owned any slaves,” “the Englishman who says ‘I never did any wrong to Ireland,’” or “the young German who believes that being born after 1945 means that what Nazis did to Jews has no moral relevance to his relationship to his Jewish contemporaries” all exhibit a kind of intellectual and moral failure. “I am born with a past, and to cut myself off from that past in the individualist mode, is to deform my present relationships” (p. 221).  For MacIntyre, there is no moral identity for the abstract individual; “The self has to find its moral identity in and through its membership in communities” (p. 221).

Since MacIntyre finds social identity necessary for the individual, MacIntyre’s definition of the excellence or virtue of the human agent needs a social dimension:

The virtues find their point and purpose not only in sustaining those relationships necessary if the variety of goods internal to practices are to be achieved and not only in sustaining the form of an individual life in which that individual may seek out his or her good as the good of his or her whole life, but also in sustaining those traditions which provide both practices and individual lives with their necessary historical context (AV, p. 223).

This third, social, level completes MacIntyre’s account of the excellence of the human agent in AV.

iii. Aristotelian Critique of Modern Ethics and Politics

The remaining chapters of AV contrast MacIntyre’s Aristotelian notion of the virtues as excellences of character from modern notions of virtue as the quality of a person who obeys moral rules. These chapters also lay out some of the practical implications of MacIntyre’s Aristotelian project for contemporary ethics and politics. The loss of teleology makes morality appear arbitrary (AV, p. 236), separates moral reason from practical and political reasoning (AV, p. 236), and removes the notion of what one deserves from modern notions of justice (AV, p. 249). MacIntyre concludes that “modern systematic politics . . . expresses in its institutional forms a systematic rejection” of the Aristotelian tradition of the virtues and therefore “has to be rejected” by those who commit themselves to the tradition of the virtues (AV, p. 255). In other words, those who approach moral and political philosophy in terms of the development of the human agent and the advancement of practical reasoning in the context of the life of a community cannot succeed in their task if they compromise their work by committing themselves to the arbitrary goals, methods, and language of modern politics.

At the end of the argument of AV, MacIntyre returns to the ultimatum of chapter 10, “Nietzsche or Aristotle.” Where Nietzsche intended his work as a critique of modern morality, Nietzsche in fact becomes the ultimate embodiment of the moral isolation and arbitrariness of modern liberal individualism. This fault remains invisible from a modern viewpoint, but when viewed from the perspective of the Aristotelian tradition of the virtues, it is quite clear (AV, pp. 258-259).

Since “goods, and with them the only grounds for the authority of laws and virtues, can only be discovered by entering into those relationships which constitute communities whose central bond is a shared vision of and understanding of goods” (AV, p. 258), any hope for the transformation and renewal of society depends on the development and maintenance of such communities. Revolution cannot be imposed (AV, p. 238), although it may be cultivated. To wait “for another—doubtless very different—St. Benedict,” is to await a person who can unify communities that encourage moral formation in judgment and action.

iv. Criticism of AV

MacIntyre’s Aristotelian approach to ethics as a study of human action distinguishes him from post-Kantian moral philosophers who approach ethics as a means of determining the demands of objective, impersonal, universal morality. This modern approach may be described as moral epistemology. Modern moral philosophy pretends to free the individual to determine for her- or himself what she or he must do in a given situation, irrespective of her or his own desires; it pretends to give knowledge of universal moral laws. MacIntyre rejects modern ethical theories as deceptive and self-deceiving masks for conventional morality and for arbitrary interventions against traditions. For MacIntyre, the freedom of self-determination is the freedom to recognize and pursue one’s good, and moral philosophy liberates the agent, in part, by helping the human agent to desire what is good and best, and to choose what is good and best.

MacIntyre’s ethics of human action also distinguishes his later Thomistic work from the efforts of some twentieth-century neo-Thomists to craft a moral epistemology out of Thomas Aquinas’s metaphysics and natural law. AV argues that an Aristotelian ethics of virtue may remain possible, without appealing to Aristotle’s metaphysics of nature. This claim remains controversial for two different, but closely related reasons.

Many of those who rejected MacIntyre’s turn to Aristotle define “virtue” primarily along moral lines, as obedience to law or adherence to some kind of natural norm. For these critics, “virtuous” appears synonymous with “morally correct;” their resistance to MacIntyre’s appeal to virtue stems from their difficulties either with what they take to be the shortcomings of MacIntyre’s account of moral correctness or with the notion of moral correctness altogether.  Thus one group of critics rejects MacIntyre’s Aristotelianism because they hold that any Aristotelian account of the virtues must first account for the truth about virtue in terms of Aristotle’s philosophy of nature, which MacIntyre had dismissed in AV as “metaphysical biology” (AV, pp. 162, 179). Aristotelian metaphysicians, particularly Thomists who define virtue in terms of the perfection of nature, rejected MacIntyre’s contention that an adequate Aristotelian account of virtue as excellence in practical reasoning and human action need not appeal to Aristotelian metaphysics. Another group of critics, including materialists, dismissed MacIntyre’s attempt to recover an Aristotelian account of the virtues because they took those virtues to presuppose an indefensible metaphysical doctrine of nature.

A few years after the publication of AV, MacIntyre became a Thomist and accepted that the teleology of human action flowed from a metaphysical foundation in the nature of the human person (WJWR, ch. 10; AV, 3rd ed., p. xi). Nonetheless, MacIntyre has the main points of his ethics and politics of human action have remained the same. MacIntyre continues to argue toward an Aristotelian account of practical reasoning through the investigation of practice. Even though he has accepted Thomistic metaphysics, he seldom argues from metaphysical premises, and when pressed to explain the metaphysical foundations of his ethics, he has demurred. MacIntyre continues to argue from the experience of practical reasoning to the demands of moral education. MacIntyre’s work in WJWR, DRA, The Tasks of Philosophy, Ethics and Politics, and God, Philosophy, University continue to exemplify the phenomenological approach to moral education that MacIntyre took in After Virtue.

Contemporary scholars have defended MacIntyre’s unconventional Aristotelianism by challenging the conventions that MacIntyre is said to violate. Christopher Stephen Lutz examined some of the reasons for rejecting “Aristotle’s metaphysical biology” and assessed the compatibility of MacIntyre’s philosophy with that of Thomas Aquinas in Tradition in the Ethics of Alasdair MacIntyre (2004, pp. 133-140). Kelvin Knight took a broader approach in Aristotelian Philosophy: Ethics and Politics from Aristotle to MacIntyre (2007). Knight examined the ethics and politics of human action found in Aristotle and traced the development of that project through medieval and modern thought to MacIntyre. Knight distinguishes Aristotle’s ethics of human action from his metaphysics and shows how it is possible for MacIntyre to retrieve Aristotle’s ethics of human action without first defending Aristotle’s metaphysical account of nature.

b. Two Books on Rationality: WJWR and 3RV

For MacIntyre, “rationality” comprises all the intellectual resources, both formal and substantive, that we use to judge truth and falsity in propositions, and to determine choice-worthiness in courses of action. Rationality in this sense is not universal; it differs from community to community and from person to person, and may both develop and regress over the course of a person’s life or a community’s history. MacIntyre describes this culturally relative, even subjective characteristic of rationality in the first chapter of WJWR (1988):

So rationality itself, whether theoretical or practical, is a concept with a history: indeed, since there are also a diversity of traditions of enquiry, with histories, there are, so it will turn out, rationalities rather than rationality, just as it will also turn out that there are justices rather than justice (WJWR, p. 9).

Rationality is the collection of theories, beliefs, principles, and facts that the human subject uses to judge the world, and a person’s rationality is, to a large extent, the product of that person’s education and moral formation.

To the extent that a person accepts what is handed down from the moral and intellectual traditions of her or his community in learning to judge truth and falsity, good and evil, that person’s rationality is “tradition-constituted.” Tradition-constituted rationality provides the schemata by which we interpret, understand, and judge the world we live in. The apparent reasonableness of mythical explanations, religious doctrines, scientific theories, and the conflicting demands of the world’s moral codes all depend on the tradition-constituted rationalities of those who judge them. For this reason, some of MacIntyre’s critics have argued that tradition-constituted rationality entails an absolute relativism in philosophy.

The apparent problem of relativism in MacIntyre’s theory of rationality is much like the problem of relativism in the philosophy of science. Scientific claims develop within larger theoretical frameworks, so that the apparent truth of a scientific claim depends on one’s judgment of the larger framework. The resolution of the problem of relativism therefore appears to hang on the possibility of judging frameworks or rationalities, or judging between frameworks or rationalities from a position that does not presuppose the truth of the framework or rationality, but no such theoretical standpoint is humanly possible. Nonetheless, MacIntyre finds that the world itself provides the criterion for the testing of rationalities, and he finds that there is no criterion except the world itself that can stand as the measure of the truth of any philosophical theory. So MacIntyre balances the relativity of rationality against the objectivity of the world that we investigate. As Popper and Lakatos found in the philosophy of science, MacIntyre concludes that experience can falsify theory, releasing people from the apparent authority of traditional rationalities.

MacIntyre holds that the rationality of individuals is not only tradition-constituted, it is also tradition constitutive, as individuals make their own contributions to their own rationality, and to the rationalities of their communities. Rationality is not fixed, within either the history of a community or the life of a person. Unexplainable events can occur that reveal shortcomings in a person’s rational resources, like the anomalous data that precipitate scientific revolutions in Thomas Kuhn’s The Structure of Scientific Revolutions or demand changes in research programmes in Imre Lakatos’ The Methodology of Scientific Research Programmes. Problems exposed by anomalous data or by conflicts with other traditions, other communities, or other people may prove rationally insoluble under the constraints that a given tradition places on rationality. Such events, when fully recognized, demand creative solutions, and it may happen that some person or group will discover what appears to be a more adequate response to those problems. To the extent that these new solutions are adopted by others and passed on to subsequent generations (for better or for worse), the rationality of those responsible for the new approach becomes “tradition-constitutive.”

The possibility that experience may falsify theory distinguishes MacIntyre’s theory of tradition-constituted and tradition-constitutive rationality from forms of relativism that make rationality entirely tradition-dependent or entirely subjective. Nonetheless, MacIntyre denies that such falsification is common (WJWR, chs. 18 and 19), and history shows us that individuals, communities, and even whole nations may commit themselves militantly over long periods of their histories to doctrines that their ideological adversaries find irrational. This qualified relativism of appearances has troublesome implications for anyone who believes that philosophical enquiry can easily provide certain knowledge of the world. According to MacIntyre, theories govern the ways that we interpret the world and no theory is ever more than “the best standards so far” (3RV, p. 65). Our theories always remain open to improvement, and when our theories change, the appearances of our world—the apparent truths of claims judged within those theoretical frameworks—change with them.

From the subjective standpoint of the human enquirer, MacIntyre finds that theories, concepts, and facts all have histories, and they are all liable to change—for better or for worse. MacIntyre’s philosophy offers a decisive refutation of modern epistemology, even as it maintains philosophy is a quest for truth. MacIntyre’s philosophy is indebted to the philosophy of science, which recognizes the historicism of scientific enquiry even as it seeks a truthful understanding of the world. MacIntyre’s philosophy does not offer a priori certainty about any theory or principle; it examines the ways in which reflection upon experience supports, challenges, or falsifies theories that have appeared to be the best theories so far to the people who have accepted them so far. MacIntyre’s ideal enquirers remain Hamlets, not Emmas.

i. Whose Justice? Which Rationality?

WJWR presents MacIntyre’s most thorough argument for his theory of rationality. He summarizes the main points of his theory in chapter 1. In chapters 2 through 16, MacIntyre follows the progress of the Western tradition through “three distinct traditions:” from Homer and Aristotle to Thomas Aquinas, from Augustine to Thomas Aquinas and from Augustine through Calvin to Hume (WJWR, p. 326). The inhabitants of these traditions work to deepen, correct, and extend the claims and theories of their predecessors. Chapter 17 examines the modern liberal denial of tradition, and the ironic transformation of liberalism into the fourth tradition to be treated in the book. Chapter 18 reviews MacIntyre’s claims and conclusions concerning the tradition-constituted nature and tradition-constitutive power of human rationality. Chapters 19 and 20 explore the consequences of MacIntyre’s theory for conflicts between traditions.

WJWR fulfills a promise made at the end of AV: “I promised a book in which I should attempt to say both what makes it rational to act in one way rather than another and what makes it rational to advance and defend one conception of practical rationality rather than another. Here it is” (p. 9). To fulfill this promise, MacIntyre opens the book by arguing that “the Enlightenment made us . . . blind to . . . a conception of rational enquiry as embodied in a tradition, a conception according to which the standards of rational justification themselves emerge from and are part of a history.” From the standpoint of human enquiry, no group can arrogate to itself the authority to guide everyone else toward the good. We can only struggle together in our quests for justice and truth and each community consequently frames and revises its own standards of justice and rationality. MacIntyre concludes that neither reason nor justice is universal: “since there are a diversity of traditions of enquiry, with histories, there are, so it will turn out, rationalities rather than rationality, just as it will also turn out that there are justices rather than justice” (p. 9).

The thesis that rationalities and justices arise from the histories and traditions of communities sets MacIntyre squarely at odds with all modern philosophy, and particularly with the unacknowledged imperialism of any form of metaethics that would offer a neutral, third-party forum in which to adjudicate the practical differences between contending moral traditions by the peculiar standards of modern liberal individualism. The same thesis also appears to set MacIntyre at odds with the traditions of Aristotle and Thomas Aquinas—traditions he claims to accept and defend—which make unambiguous claims about the universal nature, true reason, and objective justice. The book therefore has two tasks. On the one hand, the book relates the histories of particular rationalities and justices in a way that undermines the abstract universal notions of reason and justice that provide the foundations for modern moral and political thought. On the other hand, the book provides prima facie evidence

that those who have thought their way through the topics of justice and practical rationality, from the standpoint constructed by and in the direction pointed out first by Aristotle and then by Aquinas, have every reason at least so far to hold that the rationality of their tradition has been confirmed by its encounters with other traditions (p. 403).

In short, the book offers an internal critique of modernity, arguing that it is incoherent by its own standards, and it offers an internal justification of Thomism, holding that Thomism is rationally justified, for Thomists, by Thomist standards. Contrary to initial expectations, MacIntyre’s historicist, particularist critique of modernity is compatible with the historically situated Thomist tradition.

MacIntyre holds that his historicist, particularist critique of modernity is consistent with Thomism because of the way that he understands the acquisition of first principles. In chapter 10 (pp. 164-182), MacIntyre compares Thomas Aquinas’s account of the acquisition of first principles with those of Descartes, Hobbes, Hume, Bentham, and Kant. MacIntyre explains that according to Thomas Aquinas, individuals reach first principles through “a work of dialectical construction” (p. 174). For Thomas Aquinas, by questioning and examining one’s experience, one may eventually arrive at first principles, which one may then apply to the understanding of one’s questions and experience. Descartes and his successors, by contrast, along with certain “notable Thomists of the last hundred years” (p. 175), have proposed that philosophy begins from knowledge of some “set of necessarily true first principles which any truly rational person is able to evaluate as true” (p. 175). Thus for the moderns, philosophy is a technical rather than moral endeavor, while for the Thomist, whether one might recognize first principles or be able to apply them depends in part on one’s moral development (pp. 186-182).

The modern account of first principles justifies an approach to philosophy that rejects tradition. The modern liberal individualist approach is anti-traditional. It denies that our understanding is tradition-constituted and it denies that different cultures may differ in their standards of rationality and justice:

The standpoint of traditions is necessarily at odds with one of the central characteristics of cosmopolitan modernity: the confident belief that all cultural phenomena must be potentially translucent to understanding, that all texts must be capable of being translated into the language which the adherents of modernity speak to one another (p. 327)

Modernity does not see tradition as the key that unlocks moral and political understanding, but as a superfluous accumulation of opinions that tend to prejudice moral and political reasoning.

Although modernity rejects tradition as a method of moral and political enquiry, MacIntyre finds that it nevertheless bears all the characteristics of a moral and political tradition. MacIntyre identifies the peculiar standards of the liberal tradition in the latter part of chapter 17, and summarizes the story of the liberal tradition at the outset of chapter 18:

Liberalism, beginning as a repudiation of tradition in the name of abstract, universal principles of reason, turned itself into a politically embodied power, whose inability to bring its debates on the nature and context of those universal principles to a conclusion has had the unintended effect of transforming liberalism into a tradition (p. 349).

From MacIntyre’s perspective, there is no question of deciding whether or not to work within a tradition; everyone who struggles with practical, moral, and political questions simply does. “There is no standing ground, no place for enquiry . . . apart from that which is provided by some particular tradition or other” (p. 350). MacIntyre calls his position “the rationality of traditions.”

MacIntyre distinguishes two related challenges to his position, the “relativist challenge” and the “perspectivist challenge.” These two challenges both acknowledge that the goals of the Enlightenment cannot be met and that, “the only available standards of rationality are those made available by and within traditions” (p. 252); they conclude that nothing can be known to be true or false. For these post-modern theorists, “if the Enlightenment conceptions of truth and rationality cannot be sustained,” either relativism or perspectivism “is the only possible alternative” (p. 353). MacIntyre rejects both challenges by developing his theory of tradition-constituted and tradition-constitutive rationality on pp. 354-369.

How, then, is one to settle challenges between two traditions? It depends on whether the adherents of either take the challenges of the other tradition seriously. It depends on whether the adherents of either tradition, on seeing a failure in their own tradition are willing to consider an answer offered by their rival (p. 355). There is nothing in MacIntyre’s account of the rationality of traditions that suggest that the superior traditions will vanquish inferior ones, or to provide any analogue to the modern, enlightenment, or Cartesian epistemological first principles that he rejected in his critique of the modern liberal individualist tradition.

MacIntyre emphasizes the role of tradition in the final chapter of the book by asking how a person with no traditional affiliation is to deal with the conflicting claims of rival traditions: “The initial answer is: that will depend upon who you are and how you understand yourself. This is not the kind of answer which we have been educated to expect in philosophy” (p. 393). Such a person might, through some process of reflection on experience and engagement with the claims of one tradition or another, join a tradition whose claims and standards appear compelling, but there is no guarantee of that. MacIntyre’s conclusion is that enquiry is situated within traditions.

WJWR is more than a restatement of the history from AV. AV had argued that an Aristotelian view of moral philosophy as a study of human action could make sense of the failure of modern moral philosophy while modern liberal individualism could not. Aristotelian and Thomist critics complained, however, that MacIntyre’s Aristotelianism, which sought its foundation in teleological activity rather than teleological metaphysics, remained open to the challenge that it was relativistic. WJWR advances the argument of AV in two ways. First, MacIntyre focuses the critique of modernity on the question of rational justification. Modern epistemology stands or falls on the possibility of Cartesian epistemological first principles. MacIntyre’s history exposes that notion of first principle as a fiction, and at the same time demonstrates that rational enquiry advances (or declines) only through tradition. Second, MacIntyre trades the social teleology of AV for a Thomist, metaphysical teleology. MacIntyre justifies this trade in terms acceptable within the Thomist tradition, and acknowledges that those who find Thomism irrational will find little reason to accept it (WJWR P. 403). This general conclusion remained troubling for Aristotelians, and particularly for those Neo-Thomists whose Neo-Scholastic tradition bore debts to the Cartesian tradition.

ii. Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry

MacIntyre presented his theory of rationality again in his 1988 Gifford Lectures, published as Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry (1990). The central idea of the Gifford Lectures is that philosophers make progress by addressing the shortcomings of traditional narratives about the world, shortcomings that become visible either through the failure of traditional narratives to make sense of experience, or through the introduction of contradictory narratives that prove impossible to dismiss. This vision of progress in philosophy is the same as that of EC, and WJWR, but the presentation is different. In this book, MacIntyre compares three traditions exemplified by three literary works published near the end of Adam Gifford’s life (1820–1887);  a bequest of Lord Gifford’s will funds the Gifford Lectures.  The Ninth Edition of the Encyclopaedia Britannica (1875–1889) represents the modern tradition of trying to understand the world objectively without the influence of tradition.  The Genealogy of Morals (1887), by Friedrich Nietzsche embodies the post-modern tradition of interpreting all traditions as arbitrary impositions of power.  The encyclical letter Aeterni Patris (1879) of Pope Leo XIII exemplifies the approach of acknowledging one’s predecessors within one’s own tradition of enquiry and working to advance or improve that tradition in the pursuit of objective truth.  Of the three versions of moral enquiry treated in 3RV, only tradition, exemplified in 3RV by the Aristotelian, Thomistic tradition, understands itself as a tradition that looks backward to predecessors in order to understand present questions and move forward. Encyclopaedia, concerns itself only with present facts, and leaves the problems of intellectual history to others. Genealogy defends an historicist interpretation of the past to undermine what it takes to be irrational moral convictions in the present. MacIntyre argues that Encyclopaedists and Genealogists deceive themselves in their rejections of the method of tradition.

Encyclopaedia obscures the role of tradition by presenting the most current conclusions and convictions of a tradition as if they had no history, and as if they represented the final discovery of unalterable truth. In this sense, Encyclopaedia represents the epistemological “Emmas” of MacIntyre’s 1977 essay, EC. Encyclopaedists focus on the present and ignore the past.

Genealogists, on the other hand, focus on the past in order to undermine the claims of the present. The “Nietzschean research program” has three uses for history: (1) to reduce academic history to a projection of the concerns of modern historians, (2) to dissipate the identity of the historian into a collection of inherited cultural influences, and (3) to undermine the notion of “progress towards truth and reason” (3RV, pp. 49-50). In short, Genealogy denies the teleology of human enquiry by denying (1) that historical enquiry has been fruitful, (2) that the enquiring person has a real identity, and (3) that enquiry has a real goal. MacIntyre finds this mode of enquiry incoherent.

To provide an example of the incoherence of the Genealogical mode of enquiry MacIntyre turns to Foucault and begins by describing the “self-endangering paradox” Foucault—or anyone who would maintain and extend the Nietzschean research program—must face: “the insights conferred by this post-Nietzschean understanding of the uses of history are themselves liable to subvert the project of understanding the project” (3RV, p. 50). MacIntyre argues against each of the three Nietzschean uses of history, beginning with the denial of the fruitfulness of the study.

MacIntyre cites Foucault’s 1966 book, Les Mots et les choses (The Order of Things, 1970) as an example of the self-subverting character of Genealogical enquiry. Foucault’s book reduces history to a procession of “incommensurable ordered schemes of classification and representation” none of which has any greater claim to truth than any other, yet this book “is itself organized as a scheme of classification and representation.” In the light of its own account of history, it seems difficult to justify the claims of the book rationally. If historical narratives are only projections of the interests of historians, then it is difficult to see how this historical narrative can claim to be truthful.

Genealogical moral enquiry cannot make sense of its own claims without exempting those claims from its general critique of similar claims. Genealogical moral enquiry must make similar exceptions to its treatments of the unity of the enquiring subject and the teleology of moral enquiry; thus “it seems to be the case that the intelligibility of genealogy requires beliefs and allegiances of a kind precluded by the genealogical stance” (3RV, p. 54-55). Genealogy is self-deceiving insofar as it ignores the traditional and teleological character of its enquiry.

3RV uses Thomism as its example of tradition, but this use should not suggest that MacIntyre identifies “tradition” with Thomism or Thomism-as-a-name-for-the-Western-tradition. As noted above, WJWR distinguished four traditions of enquiry within the Western European world alone (WJWR, p. 349). MacIntyre uses Thomism because it applies the traditional mode of enquiry in a self-conscious manner. Thomistic students learn the work of philosophical enquiry as apprentices in a craft (3RV, p. 61), and maintain the principles of the tradition in their work to extend the understanding of the tradition, even as they remain open to the criticism of those principles.

Tradition differs from both encyclopaedia and genealogy in the way it understands the place of its theories in the history of human enquiry. The adherent of a tradition must understand that “the rationality of a craft is justified by its history so far,” thus it “is inseparable from the tradition through which it was achieved” (3RV, p. 65). To justify the claims of a tradition is to recount how the tradition has developed and understood those claims so far. To master a tradition is also “a matter of knowing how to go further, and especially how to direct others towards going further, using what can be learned from the tradition afforded by the past to move towards the telos of fully perfected work” (3RV, pp. 65-66). Tradition is not merely conservative; it remains open to improvement, and in the 1977 essay EC, it is Hamlet, not Emma, who exemplifies the traditional mode of enquiry.

MacIntyre’s emphasis on the temporality of rationality in traditional enquiry makes tradition incompatible with the epistemological projects of modern philosophy (3RV, pp. 69).

MacIntyre uses Thomas Aquinas to illustrate the revolutionary potential of traditional enquiry. Thomas was educated in Augustinian theology and Aristotelian philosophy, and through this education he began to see not only the contradictions between the two traditions, but also the strengths and weaknesses that each tradition revealed in the other. His education also helped him to discover a host of questions and problems that had to be answered and solved. Many of Thomas Aquinas’ responses to these concerns took the form of disputed questions. “Yet to each question the answer produced by Aquinas as a conclusion is no more than and, given Aquinas’s method, cannot but be no more than, the best answer reached so far. And hence derives the essential incompleteness” (3RV, p. 124). Thomas Aquinas, viewed as practicing the traditional mode of enquiry, is one influential practitioner within a tradition and his writings are contributions to that tradition, rather than collections of unassailable final conclusions. MacIntyre’s Thomistic responses to encyclopedia and genealogy in chapters eight and nine show that MacIntyre does not view the Thomistic tradition in particular, or the traditional mode of enquiry in general, as closed, static, or essentially conservative.

c. Dependent Rational Animals

MacIntyre’s Carus Lectures, Dependent Rational Animals: Why Human Beings Need the Virtues (1999), put MacIntyre’s theory of rationality into practice to examine the conditions of human action and to argue that the virtues are essential to the practice of independent practical reason. The book is relentlessly practical; its arguments appeal only to experience and to purposes, and to the logic of practical reasoning.

DRA does not make metaphysical assertions about the human soul, or human dignity, or human rights, or natural law; it treats the human agent as an animal. “Human identity is primarily . . . bodily and therefore animal identity and it is by reference to that identity that the continuities of our relationships to others are partly defined” (DRA, p. 8). Like other intelligent animals, human beings enter life vulnerable, weak, untrained, and unknowing, and face the likelihood of infirmity in sickness and in old age. Like other social animals, humans flourish in groups. We learn to regulate our passions, and to act effectively alone and in concert with others through an education provided within a community. MacIntyre’s position allows him to look to the animal world to find analogies to the role of social relationships in the moral formation of human beings (DRA, pp. 21-28).

In chapter 8, MacIntyre turns to the moral development of the human agent. The task for the human child is to make “the transition from the infantile exercise of animal intelligence to the exercise of independent practical reasoning” (DRA, p. 87). For a child to make this transition is “to redirect and transform her or his desires, and subsequently to direct them consistently towards the goods of different stages of her or his life” (DRA, p. 87). The development of independent practical reason in the human agent requires the moral virtues in at least three ways.

As in his earlier writings, including his MA thesis, DRA presents moral knowledge as a “knowing how,” rather than as a “knowing that.” Knowledge of moral rules is not sufficient for a moral life; prudence is required to enable the agent to apply the rules well. “Knowing how to act virtuously always involves more than rule-following” (DRA, p. 93). The prudent person can judge what must be done in the absence of a rule and can also judge when general norms cannot be applied to particular cases.

Flourishing as an independent practical reasoner requires the virtues in a second way, simply because sometimes we need our friends to tell us who we really are. Independent practical reasoning also requires self-knowledge, but self-knowledge is impossible without the input of others whose judgment provides a reliable touchstone to test our beliefs about ourselves. Self-knowledge therefore requires the virtues that enable an agent to sustain formative relationships and to accept the criticism of trusted friends (DRA, p. 97).

Human flourishing requires the virtues in a third way, by making it possible to participate in social and political action. They enable us to “protect ourselves and others against neglect, defective sympathies, stupidity, acquisitiveness, and malice” (DRA, p. 98) by enabling us to form and sustain social relationships through which we may care for one another in our infirmities, and pursue common goods with and for the other members of our societies.

The book moves from MacIntyre’s assessment of human needs for the virtues to the political implications of that assessment. Social and political institutions that form and enable independent practical reasoning must “satisfy three conditions.” (1) They must enable their members to participate in shared deliberations about the communities’ actions. (2) They must establish norms of justice “consistent with exercise of” the virtue of justice. (3) They must enable the strong “to stand proxy” as advocates for the needs of the weak and the disabled.

The social and political institutions that MacIntyre recommends cannot be identified with the modern nation state or the modern nuclear family. Modern nation states, which MacIntyre characterizes as “giant utility companies” (DRA, p. 132) are organized to provide services, not to pursue a common good. The nuclear family is too small to allow the self-sufficiency required for the political community that pursues a common good (DRA, p. 133-5). The political structures necessary for human flourishing are essentially local. MacIntyre says, “It is . . . a mistake, the communitarian mistake, to attempt to infuse the politics of the state with the values and modes of participation in local community” (DRA, p. 142). Yet local communities support human flourishing only when they actively support “the virtues of just generosity and shared deliberation” (DRA, p. 142). To find examples of the kinds of local communities that support human flourishing, MacIntyre suggests investigations of “fishing communities in New England . . . Welsh mining communities . . . farming cooperatives in Donegal, Mayan towns in Guatemala and Mexico”( DRA, p. 143).

Coming to the conclusion that moral knowledge and understanding develops within, and is partly constituted by social relationships within particular local communities that require their members to commit themselves to the moral narratives and norms of those communities, MacIntyre finds himself compelled to answer what may be called the question of moral provincialism: If one is to seek the truth about morality and justice, it seems necessary to “find a standpoint that is sufficiently external to the evaluative attitudes and practices that are to be put to the question.” If it is impossible for the agent to take such an external standpoint, if the agent’s commitments preclude radical criticism of the virtues of the community, does that leave the agent “a prisoner of shared prejudices” (DRA, p. 154)?

In the final chapter of DRA, MacIntyre argues that it is impossible to find an external standpoint, because rational enquiry is an essentially social work (DRA, p. 156-7). Because it is social, shared rational enquiry requires moral commitment to, and practice of, the virtues to prevent the more complacent members of communities from closing off critical reflection upon “shared politically effective beliefs and concepts” (DRA, p. 161). “Moral commitment to these virtues and to the common good is not an external constraint upon, but a condition of enquiry and criticism” (DRA, p. 162). MacIntyre contrasts this account of social rational enquiry rooted in moral commitment to the standards of a community against Nietzsche’s notion of independence. In the light of the whole argument of DRA, MacIntyre’s conclusion shows, much more clearly than his remarks at the end of AV, why Nietzsche’s ideal of independence provides a poor model and a misleading guide for human flourishing.

d. The Tasks of Philosophy: Selected Essays, Volume 1

In 2006, MacIntyre published two new collections of selected essays. Both volumes include valuable prefaces discussing the origin, importance, and intentions of each of the essays. The first volume, The Tasks of Philosophy, addresses the goals and methods of philosophical enquiry. It opens with EC, and MacIntyre’s remarks in the preface confirm the essay’s place as the starting point of MacIntyre’s mature work. Five more essays in the first part of the book explore the role of culture in our experience of the world, the problem of relativism, the mistake of ignoring the role of history and personal freedom in the development of individual character, the unity of the human person as an embodied mind, and the failure of modern moral philosophy.

The second part of The Tasks of Philosophy, “The Ends of Philosophical Enquiry” discusses the pursuit of truth. Chapter 7, “The Ends of Life, the Ends of Philosophical Writing,” treats philosophy as a professionalized outgrowth of the natural work of plain persons who struggle with ordinary questions about what it means to live well, or how laws have authority, or whether death has meaning (Tasks, p. 125). The literature of philosophy addresses questions like these, but whether philosophy can be fruitful for its reader depends on whether philosophers also engage those questions, or set the questions aside to focus on the literature of philosophy instead.

MacIntyre credits John Stuart Mill and Thomas Aquinas as “two philosophers of the kind who by their writing send us beyond philosophy into immediate encounter with the ends of life” (Tasks, p. 128). From their example, MacIntyre identifies three characteristics of good philosophical writing.

First, both were engaged by questions about the ends of life as questioning human beings and not just as philosophers. . . . Secondly, both Mill and Aquinas understood their speaking and writing as contributing to an ongoing philosophical conversation. . . . Thirdly, it matters that both the end of the conversation and the good of those who participate in it is truth and that the nature of truth, of good, of rational justification, and of meaning therefore have to be central topics of that conversation (Tasks, pp. 130-1).

Without these three characteristics, philosophy is first reduced to “the exercise of a set of analytic and argumentative skills. . . . Secondly, philosophy may thereby become a diversion from asking questions about the ends of life with any seriousness” (Tasks, p. 131). Third, philosophers’ serious professional enquiries into the writings of other philosophers regarding answers to the questions about the ends of human life may divert their attention completely from those same questions in their own lives.

MacIntyre illustrates this problem by reviewing the responses of Franz Rosenzweig and Georg Lukács to the decline of German NeoKantianism in the early twentieth century. Both Rosenzweig and Lukács abandoned the philosophical orthodoxy into which they had been educated, and in both cases, their abandonment of ideological NeoKantianism marked the beginning of their pursuit of the true ends of philosophy. Rosenzweig’s pursuit of the true ends of philosophy led to “dialogue without theorizing,” while Lukács’s work collapsed into Stalinist “theorizing without dialogue” (Tasks, p. 139). Neither Rosenzweig nor Lukács made philosophical progress because both failed to relate “their questions about the ends of life to the ends of their philosophical writing” (Tasks, p. 139).

To avoid the mistakes of Rosenzweig and Lukács, MacIntyre counsels his readers to remain attached to the questions that philosophy attempts to answer, so that their “beliefs about the ends of life” do not become “detached from the questions to which they are the answer” (Tasks, p. 139). MacIntyre’s recognition of the connection between an author’s pursuit of the ends of life and the same author’s work as a philosophical writer prompts him to finish the essay by demanding three things of philosophical historians and biographers. First, any adequate philosophical history or biography must determine whether the authors studied remain engaged with the questions that philosophy studies, or set the questions aside in favor of the answers. Second, any adequate philosophical history or biography must determine whether the authors studied insulated themselves from contact with conflicting worldviews or remained open to learning from every available philosophical approach. Third, any adequate philosophical history or biography must place the authors studied into a broader context that shows what traditions they come from and “whose projects” they are “carrying forward” (Tasks, p. 142).

Philosophy is not just a study; it is a practice. Excellence in this practice demands that an author bring her or his struggles with the questions of the ends of philosophy into dialogue with historic and contemporary texts and authors in the hope of making progress in answering those questions.

The three essays that complete the volume underscore the challenge MacIntyre gives at the end of “The Ends of Life and the Ends of Philosophical Writing.” These three essays approach the work of philosophy from the perspective of Thomism. Thomism, caricatured in one way by its twentieth-century promoters through deficient textbooks, misguided ideological projects, and abuse in Church politics, and in another by its detractors as an atavistic attachment to an obsolete worldview, has been increasingly marginalized since the 1960s. The three Thomistic essays in this book challenge those caricatures by presenting Thomism in a way that people outside of contemporary Thomistic scholarship may find surprisingly flexible and open; for MacIntyre’s Thomas Aquinas is caught up in the difficulties of the questions of the ends of philosophy no less than MacIntyre and other contemporary philosophers. All three essays return to the notion of enquiry as action. Setting aside the epistemological fictions that modern philosophers, including NeoThomists, had invented in a misguided effort to counter skepticism, MacIntyre defends Thomistic realism as rational enquiry directed to the discovery of truth.

e. Ethics and Politics: Selected Essays, Volume 2

Ethics and Politics (Hereafter E&P) is divided into three parts: “Learning from Aristotle and Aquinas,” “Ethics,” and “The Politics of Ethics.” Essays in the first part compare and contrast Aristotle’s philosophy with some renaissance and modern interpretations of it, examine the political context of Thomas Aquinas’s work on the natural law, and defend Thomas’s natural law theory through a critique of moral epistemology. Essays in the second part investigate the apparent problems of moral dilemmas and the real difficulties of determining whether and when it may be more reasonable to deceive or to lie than to tell the truth. Essays in the third part address the ways that rational enquiry can inform social life.

Two of the essays in the third part of E&P are particularly important to the development of MacIntyre’s thought. “Three Perspectives on Marxism” is the preface to the 1995 edition of M&C. The essay assesses both MI (1953) and M&C (1968), along with the economic and political conditions of 1995, and helps to map the consistency of his positions through nearly forty years of development.

“Social Structures and Their Threats to Moral Agency” expands and develops on the theme of compartmentalization that MacIntyre touched upon in AV (AV, p. 204). The essay examines social structures that encourage compartmentalization of one’s life and thus threaten the human agent’s capacity to recognize, judge, and do what is good and best for her- or himself, as a member of a larger community. MacIntyre considers “the case of J” (J, for jemand, the German word for “someone”), a train controller who learned, as a standard for his social role, to take no interest in what his trains carried, even during war time when they carried “munitions and . . . Jews on their way to extermination camps” (E&P, p. 187). J had learned to do his work for the railroad according to one set of standards and to live other parts of his life according to other standards, so that this compliant participant in “the final solution” could contend, “You cannot charge me with moral failure” (E&P, p. 187).

MacIntyre does not accept J’s relativist defense. J’s moral failure has nothing to do with his conscientious obedience to cultural standards; it stems from his failure to stand up as a moral agent. MacIntyre lists three characteristics of the self understanding of a moral agent. To be a moral agent, (1) one must understand one’s individual identity as transcending all the roles that one fills; (2) one must see oneself as a practically rational individual who can judge and reject unjust social standards; and (3) one must understand oneself as “as accountable to others in respect of the human virtues and not just in respect of [one’s] role-performances” (E&P, p. 196). J is guilty, not because he knowingly participated in the final solution; MacIntyre allows that J knew nothing about it and that his claim of innocence was sincere. J is guilty because he complacently accepted social structures that he should have questioned, structures that undermined his moral agency. This essay shows that MacIntyre’s ethics of human agency is not just a descriptive narrative about the manner of moral education; it is a standard laden account of the demands of moral agency.

f. God, Philosophy, Universities

God, Philosophy, Universities looks at the history of the Catholic philosophical tradition through its sources, its initial development through Thomas Aquinas, its decline into a silence that lasted from 1700 to 1850, its renewal in response to Pope Leo XIII’s encyclical letter Aeterni Patris (1879) and its redevelopment in the twentieth century. This history returns to AV’s account of the relationships between practices and institutions, for the different parts of this history are marked by varying relationships between the practice of philosophy within the Catholic Church and the political, ecclesial, and academic institutions that have supported it. The Catholic practice of philosophy was left moribund when its practitioners bowed to institutional pressures in the transition from late medieval to early modern philosophy (God, Philosophy, Universities, p. 106). But this practice was resuscitated by the authority of the Church in 1879 when Leo XIII promulgated the encyclical Aeterni Patris. MacIntyre credits Pope John Paul II for redefining the Catholic intellectual tradition and its relationship to the teaching authority of the Catholic Church in the 1998 encyclical letter Fides et Ratio, and he recommends new research programs to help the Catholic intellectual tradition to make progress in the future.

5. The Main Themes of MacIntyre's Philosophy

a. The Ethics and Politics of Human Agency

What emerges from MacIntyre’s work is an ethics of human agency, in contrast to modern moral normative ethics and metaethics. The best summary of MacIntyre’s ethics of human agency is found in Kelvin Knight’s Aristotelian Philosophy: Ethics and Politics from Aristotle to MacIntyre (Polity Press, 2007).

The epistemological theories of Modern moral philosophy were supposed to provide rational justification for rules, policies, and practical determinations according to abstract universal standards, but MacIntyre has dismissed those theories, not only in AV, but in every major publication of his career. Modern metaethics is supposed to enable its practitioners to step away from the conflicting demands of contending moral traditions and to judge those conflicts from a neutral position, but MacIntyre has rejected this project as well. In his ethical writings, MacIntyre seeks only to understand how to liberate the human agent from blindness and stupidity, to prepare the human agent to recognize what is good and best to do in the concrete circumstances of that agent’s own life, and to strengthen the agent to follow through on that judgment. In his political writings, MacIntyre investigates the role of communities in the formation of effective rational agents, and the impact of political institutions on the lives of communities. This kind of ethics and politics is appropriately named the ethics of human agency.

MacIntyre is sometimes categorized as a “virtue ethicist,” and AV is counted among the principle texts in virtue ethics, but this label may be misleading for MacIntyre. Virtue ethics developed as an alternative to modern moral theories. The purpose of the modern moral philosophy of authors like Kant and Mill was to determine, rationally and universally, what kinds of behavior ought to be performed—not in terms of the agent’s desires or goals, but in terms of universal, rational duties. Those theories purported to let agents know what they ought to do by providing knowledge of duties and obligations, thus they could be described as theories of moral epistemology.

Contemporary virtue ethics proposes an alternative to modern moral theory, but takes for granted that the purpose of ethics is to provide a moral epistemology. Contemporary virtue ethics purports to let agents know what qualities human beings ought to have, and the reasons that we ought to have them, not in terms of our fitness for human agency, but in the same universal, disinterested, non-teleological terms that it inherits from Kant and Mill. MacIntyre’s ethical project examines the virtues, but it is not a branch of moral epistemology.

For MacIntyre, moral knowledge remains a “knowing how” rather than a “knowing that;” MacIntyre seeks to identify those moral and intellectual excellences that make human beings more effective in our pursuit of the human good. MacIntyre’s purpose in his ethics of human agency is to consider what it means to seek one’s good, what it takes to pursue one’s good, and what kind of a person one must become if one wants to pursue that good effectively as a human agent. As a philosophy of human agency, MacIntyre’s work belongs to the traditions of Aristotle and Thomas Aquinas.

Teleology and Metaphysics: From the beginning of his career, MacIntyre has pursued teleological practical reasoning, rather than utilitarian or deontological moral reasoning. The Project proposed in “Notes from the Moral Wilderness” is a teleological project. “Freedom and Revolution” and “Can Medicine Dispense with a Theological Perspective on Human Nature?” are likewise teleological. AV criticized Christian voluntarism and divine command theory because it rejected teleological practical reasoning and adopted an arbitrary, legal model of moral reasoning. AV criticized modernity for secularizing the arbitrary, legalistic moral reasoning of Christian voluntarism.

The purpose of the constructive argument of the second half of AV is to renew teleological practical reasoning, but MacIntyre attempted to renew Aristotelian teleology while rejecting Aristotelian metaphysics. The teleology of AV, like the teleology of MacIntyre’s broader project since “Notes from the Moral Wilderness,” was to be a social teleology, discovered through reflection on experience. The social teleology appeared to have two advantages. First, it forestalled a host of objections that MacIntyre was involved in an arbitrary, atavistic project to return, whole cloth, to the world view of Aristotle including his views on the subjugation of women and “natural slaves.” Second, in keeping with the insight of Marx’s third thesis on Feuerbach, it maintained the common condition of theorists and people as peers in the pursuit of the good life.

MacIntyre grew to reconsider the adequacy of social teleology in the years following AV. In the Prologue to the 3rd edition (2007), MacIntyre reported that he had accepted from Thomas Aquinas that it was necessary to provide a metaphysical grounding for the social teleology:

It is only because human beings have an end toward which they are directed by reason of their specific nature, that practices, traditions, and the like are able to function as they do. So I discovered that I had, without realizing it, presupposed the truth of something very close to the account of the concept of good that Aquinas gives in question 5 of the first part of the Summa Theologiae (p. xi).

In MacIntyre’s subsequent Thomist works, principally WJWR (chapters 10 & 11), 3RV (chapters 5 & 6), his Aquinas Lecture, First Principles, Final Ends, and Contemporary Philosophical Issues, and “On Being a Theistic Philosopher in a Secularized Culture,” MacIntyre explicitly defends a metaphysical foundation for teleology.

In his ethical work, MacIntyre’s nonetheless continues to approach teleology primarily by examining the phenomena by which metaphysical nature manifests itself. DRA is a thoroughly Thomistic work, yet it is relentlessly practical in its argumentation. The book invites its readers to join that work of dialectical construction that might lead them to first principles. DRA does not assert the demands of substantive metaphysics; it invites its readers to discover them, whether they recognize them as such or not.

MacIntyre illustrates the need for a phenomenological approach to teleology in his two lectures on “Rival Aristotles” (in E&P, chapters 1 & 2). In these two lectures, MacIntyre examines two kinds of errors that Aristotle’s interpreters have made regarding knowledge of the human telos, and the role of that knowledge in practical reasoning. Certain renaissance Aristotelians, including Francesco Piccolomini, overstated the role of theoretical knowledge of the human good in practical reasoning (E&P, p. 14), and understated the place of character in Aristotle’s ethics. Certain contemporary Aristotelians, including Sarah Brodie, go to the opposite extreme, denying the need for knowledge of the good. MacIntyre avoids both misinterpretations. He holds that the human good plays a role in our practical reasoning whether we recognize it or not, so that some people may do well without understanding why (E&P, p. 25). He also reads Aristotle as teaching that knowledge of the good can make us better agents (E&P, p. 26).

b. Ethics and Politics

In the closely connected studies of ethics and politics, MacIntyre’s work is Aristotelian in the sense that it is a study of human action, the goals of human action, and the moral conditions that enable or hinder an agent’s recognition and pursuit of what is good and best. In keeping with his general approach to philosophy, however, MacIntyre’s Aristotelianism is phenomenological and historicist. AV does not define virtue in metaphysical terms as the perfection of nature (AV, pp. 148, 196). AV defines virtue in terms of the practical requirements for excellence in human agency, in an agent’s participation in practices (AV, ch. 14), in an agent’s whole life, and in an agent’s involvement in the life of her or his community (AV, chapter 15). This peculiar form of Aristotelianism, which MacIntyre described in the “Postscript to the 2nd ed.” of AV as “an historicist defense of Aristotle” (AV, p. 277), remains controversial among Aristotelian and Thomistic metaphysicians.

MacIntyre’s Aristotelian concept of “human action” opposes the notion of “human behavior” that prevailed among mid-twentieth-century determinist social scientists. Human actions, as MacIntyre understands them, are acts freely chosen by human agents in order to accomplish goals that those agents pursue. Human behavior, according to mid-twentieth-century determinist social scientists, is the outward activity of a subject, which is said to be caused entirely by environmental influences beyond the control of the subject. Rejecting crude determinism in social science, and approaches to government and public policy rooted in determinism, MacIntyre sees the renewal of human agency and the liberation of the human agent as central goals for ethics and politics.

As an account of human action, MacIntyre’s projects in ethics and politics continue to pursue the goals of early Marxists, who had sought to reverse the processes of individualization and proletarianization that had undermined the solidarity and self-determination of workers during the industrial revolution. William Cobbett emerges as a Quixotic hero in AV because of his opposition to the dividing and conquering influences of individualism and industrialization.

MacIntyre’s Aristotelian account of “human action” examines the habits that an agent must develop in order to judge and act most effectively in the pursuit of truly choice-worthy ends. This examination demands a rich account of deliberate human activity encompassing moral formation and community life. Where modern moral philosophy seeks rational moral criteria to judge individual human acts without considering the subjective ends of the agent, MacIntyre seeks to understand what it takes for the human person to become the kind of agent who has the practical wisdom to recognize what is good and best to do and the moral freedom to act on her or his best judgment. In this way, MacIntyre’s Aristotelian account of human action opposes the late medieval and modern reduction of ethics to the moral assessment of behavior.

MacIntyre rejected the determinism of modern social science early in his career (“Determinism,” 1957), yet he recognizes that the ability to judge well and act freely is not simply given; excellence in judgment and action must be developed, and it is the task of moral philosophy to discover how these excellences or virtues of the human agent are established, maintained, and strengthened. In this sense, MacIntyre’s ethics and politics continues the project of Aristotle, who wrote, “Neither by nature nor contrary to nature do the virtues arise in us; rather we are adapted by nature to receive them, and are made perfect by habit” (Nicomachean Ethics, 2.1 [1103a 23–25], trans. Ross).

MacIntyre’s Aristotelian philosophy investigates the conditions that support free and deliberate human action in order to propose a path to the liberation of the human agent through participation in the life of a political community that seeks its common goods through the shared deliberation and action of its members (DRA, ch. 8).

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Works

  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Marxism: An Interpretation. London: SCM Press, 1953.
    • Alasdair MacIntyre’s first published work argues for Marxist ethics and politics, criticizes Marxist social science, and defends Christian moral teaching that criticizes unjust social structures and encourages human agency.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Visions.” In New Essays in Philosophical Theology. Ed. Antony Flew and Alasdair MacIntyre. New York: Macmillan, 1955.
    • This is an example of MacIntyre’s Barthian-Wittgenstinian fideist philosophy of religion.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. "Manchester: The Modern Universities and the English Tradition," Twentieth Century, 159 (Feb. 1956): 123-9.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “The Logical Status of Religious Belief.” In Metaphysical Beliefs: Three Essays, by Stephen Toulman, Ronald W. Hepburn, and Alasdair C. MacIntyre. London: SCM Press, 1957. Reprinted with new preface, 1970. pp. 159–201.
    • This essay argues from the perspective of MacIntyre’s Barthian-Wittgenstinian fideist philosophy of religion that it is impossible to justify religious belief rationally. MacIntyre’s preface to the 1970 edition of the book condemns the essay’s “irrationalism as both false and dangerous.”
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Determinism” Mind, 66 (1957): 28-41.
    • This article criticizes determinism in the social sciences.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Notes from the Moral Wilderness” I and II, New Reasoner 7 (Winter 1958–1959): 90–100; and New Reasoner 8 (Spring 1959): 89–98. Reprinted in The MacIntyre Reader, pp. 31-49 and in Alasdair MacIntyre’s Engagement with Marxism, pp. 45-68.
    • These essays are nearly indispensable summaries of the difficulties and goals of the Marxist ethical project that would lead to AV. MacIntyre asks, what rational justification can one give for the moral critique of Stalinism. He asks how we may develop an ethics that treats moral action and moral reasoning as human action and practical reasoning.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Difficulties in Christian Belief. London: SCM Press, 1959.
    • This small book discusses the problem of evil and other difficulties in Christian belief from the perspective of MacIntyre’s Barthian-Wittgenstinian fideist philosophy of religion.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. A Short History of Ethics: A History of Moral Philosophy from the Homeric Age to Twentieth Century. New York: Macmillan, 1966. Repr. New York: Touchstone, 1996.
    • This historicist account of morality and human agency through the history of the Western tradition lays out some of the elements of the histories that would follow in AV and WJWR but it lacks the Aristotelian teleology and virtue that define MacIntyre’s mature work.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “The Debate about God: Victorian Relevance and Contemporary Irrelevance.” In Alasdair MacIntyre and Paul Ricoeur, The Religious Significance of Atheism (Bampton Lectures in America delivered at Columbia University, 1966). New York: Columbia University Press, 1969. pp. 1–55.
    • In two lectures, MacIntyre describes Theism from the perspective of atheism. The first lecture discusses the struggle between Theism and the secular intellectual culture and the choices Theists made between a self-conscious cultural atavism that is irrelevant to secular culture and deistic forms of theism that become palatable to secular culture at the price of becoming empty. The second lecture discusses factors that have undermined the relationship between social life and morality in contemporary theistic morality.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Marxism and Christianity. New York: Schocken Books, 1968. Republished, University of Notre Dame Press, 1984. Revised edition with new Introduction, London: Duckworth, 1995.
    • In 1968, MacIntyre significantly revised Marxism: An Interpretation to reflect developments in his understanding of Marxism and of the role of Friedrich Engels in Marx’s move toward predictive social science. The Introduction to the 1995 edition, which is reprinted in Ethics and Politics, helps to explain the purpose of the book and its relationship to his mature work.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Against the Self-Images of the Age: Essays on Ideology and Philosophy. London: Duckworth; New York: Schocken Books, 1971. Republished, Uniersity of Notre Dame Press, 1978.
    • This collection of essays, including journal articles published as early as 1957, is divided into two parts. The first part criticizes Marxist literature and political practice. The second part criticizes modern liberal individualist ethics and politics. This book contains many of the components of AV, but lacks the Aristotelian theory that unifies AV.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Can Medicine Dispense with a Theological Perspective on Human Nature?” In Knowledge, Value, and Belief. The Foundations of Ethics and Its Relationship to Science, Volume II. Hastings-on-Hudson, N.Y.: The Hastings Center, 1977. pp. 25–43.
    • Arguing as an atheist, MacIntyre claims that absolute precepts of ethics do not require the existence of God, but do require teleology. The teleology that can justify absolute moral precepts must be social rather than individual, thus it is necessary to reject individualism and individualistic institutions. MacIntyre speaks of various kinds of histories presenting “human life as enacted narrative.” The essay is followed by “A Rejoinder” from Paul Ramsey and “A Rejoinder to a Rejoinder” from MacIntyre.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Epistemological Crises, Dramatic Narrative, and the Philosophy of Science.” The Monist 60, no. 4 (October 1977): 453–472; reprinted in Alasdair MacIntyre, The Tasks of Philosophy. Cambridge University Press, 2006. pp. 3-23.
    • As noted in the article above, this essay is MacIntyre’s discourse on method. It is reprinted in The Tasks of Philosophy. The preface to The Tasks of Philosophy explains the importance of this essay.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Utilitarianism and Cost-Benefit Analysis: An Essay on the Relevance of Moral Philosophy to Bureaucratic Theory," in Values in the Electric Power Industry, Kenneth Sayre, ed. Notre Dame and London: University of Notre Dame Press, 1977. pp. 217-37. Reprinted as "Utilitarianism and the Presuppositions of Cost-Benefit Analysis," in The Moral Dimensions of Public Policy Choice: Beyond the Market Paradigm, John Martin Gilroy and Maurice Wade, eds. Pittsburgh and London: University of Pittsburgh Press, 1992. pp. 179-94.
    • MacIntyre discusses the unacknowledged and uncriticized role of utilitarianism in modern bureaucratic organizations, particularly in the reasoning of the “bureaucratic manager,” who appears in AV as one of the characters of the culture of emotivism. This essay presents some of MacIntyre’s earliest comments on “compartmentalization.”
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Social Science Methodology as the Ideology of Bureaucratic Authority," in Through the Looking Glass: Epistemology and the Conduct of Inquiry, Maria J. Falco, ed. (Washington: University Press of America, 1979) pp. 42-58. Reprinted in Kelvin Knight, ed. The MacIntyre Reader.  pp. 53-68.
    • This essay is an illuminating precursor to the discussion of the social sciences in chapter eight of AV.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Corporate Modernity and Moral Judgment: Are They Mutually Exclusive," in Ethics and Problems of the 21st Century, Kenneth M. Sayre and Kenneth E. Goodpaster, eds. Notre Dame and London: University of Notre Dame Press, 1979. pp. 122-35.
    • This essay works out in greater detail MacIntyre’s treatment of the replacement of unified personal identity with role-playing and his interpretation of Erving Goffman, which play important roles in MacIntyre’s critique of bureaucratic individualism in AV.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. After Virtue: A Study in Moral Theory. 2d ed. Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press, 1984. 3rd edition with new prologue, 2007.
    • This book makes two arguments. The critical argument in the first nine chapters of the book shows how the moral and political language of modern liberal individualist “culture of emotivism” has been transformed into a manipulative tool for social control. The constructive argument that makes up the rest of the book proposes the Aristotelian practical philosophy of learning to recognize and pursue what is good as an alternative to modern moral philosophy, proposes virtue, defined as excellence in human agency, as the moral goal for the renewal of culture, and argues that this culture of the virtues cannot be imposed through modern political means.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Whose Justice? Which Rationality? Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press, 1988.
    • As noted above, this book provides MacIntyre’s most extensive argument for his theory of rationality. He argues that there are justices rather than justice, and rationalities rather than rationality, but this cultural relativity in the conditions of human enquiry need not lead us to cultural relativism.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Relativism, Power, and Philosophy.” In Relativism: Interpretation and Confrontation. Edited with introduction by Michael Krausz. Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press, 1989, 182–204.
    • This is a succinct statement of the problem of relativism.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry: Encyclopaedia, Genealogy, and Tradition (Gifford Lectures). Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press, 1990.
    • MacIntyre’s Gifford Lectures digest the main points of WJWR in a shorter form using examples that make MacIntyre’s theory more accessible to general readers.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. First Principles, Final Ends, and Contemporary Philosophical Issues. The Aquinas Lecture, 1990. Milwaukee: Marquette University Press, 1990.
    • This lecture, reprinted in The Tasks of Philosophy, is MacIntyre’s most explicit defense of his approach to Thomistic metaphysics.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Plain Persons and Moral Philosophy: Rules, Virtues, and Goods.” 1991 Aquinas Lecture at the University of Dallas. American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 66, no. 1 (Winter 1992): 3–19.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “My Station and Its Virtues.” In Symposium in Memory of Edmund L. Pincoffs. Journal of Philosophical Research 19 (1994): 1–8.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Moral Relativism, Truth and Justification.” In Moral Truth and Moral Tradition: Essays in Honor of Peter Geach and Elizabeth Anscombe. Ed. Luke Gormally. Dublin: Four Courts Press, 1994, 6–24.
    • This essay is an important, succinct statement of MacIntyre’s approach to relativism.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. The Theses on Feuerbach: A Road Not Taken,” in Carol C. Gould and Robert S. Cohen, eds, Artifacts, Representations, and Social Practice: Essays for Marx Wartofsky (Kluwer Academic Publishing, 1994), reprinted in Kelvin Knight, ed., The MacIntyre Reader. pp. 223–234.
    • As noted in the article, MacIntyre explains in this essay the importance of The Theses on Feuerbach for his own career as a philosopher. Written later in MacIntyre’s career, and delivered at a gathering of “Marxists, ex-Marxists, and post-Marxists of various kinds,” this essay gives a valuable perspective on MacIntyre’s relationship with Marxist political thought.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Kinesis Interview with Professor Alasdair MacIntyre.” Interview by Thomas D. Pearson. Kinesis 20, no. 2 (Spring 1994): 34–47.
    • MacIntyre discusses his debts to Marxism, explains why financial management is not a practice, and answers some questions about his adherence to Catholic Christian teaching.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair C., and Kelvin Knight. The MacIntyre Reader. Notre Dame, Ind: University of Notre Dame Press, 1998.
    • Kelvin Knight’s “Introduction” places the 13 selections and 2 interviews into a helpful narrative. This book gathers some of the most essential texts for a through study of MacIntyre’s work, including “Notes from the Moral Wilderness,” “Moral Relativism, Truth, and Justification,” “The Theses on Feuerbach: A Road Not Taken,” the interview with Giovanna Borradori, and the interview for Cogito.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Dependent Rational Animals: Why Human Beings Need the Virtues. Chicago: Open Court, 1999.
    • Where moral philosophy textbooks typically begin with the decisions of the healthy autonomous adult as the subject matter for ethics, MacIntyre begins with vulnerability and dependence. We are vulnerable and dependent in childhood and in old age. Children must train and discipline their desires with the help of their communities if they are to achieve the relative autonomy of independent practical reasoners as adults. Adults must care for the young and old if they are to live out their lives in communities that take care of their old and young. This book is MacIntyre’s most complete statement of his moral philosophy.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair C. Edith Stein: A Philosophical Prologue, 1913 - 1922. Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield, 2006.
    • MacIntyre explores the practice of philosophy through a study of Edith Stein and of the people and problems that formed her philosophical context in the years leading to her baptism in 1922.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. The Tasks of Philosophy. Selected Essays, Volume 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006.
    • This collection includes EC, “Moral Philosophy and Contemporary Social Practice: What Holds Them Apart?” “The Ends of Life and the Ends of Philosophical Writing,” and seven other essays on the practice of philosophy. Three essays discuss Thomistic metaphysical realism.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Ethics and Politics. Selected Essays, Volume 2. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006.
    • A collection of some of MacIntyre’s best short works on ethics and politics. The book includes two essays on Thomistic natural law, “Moral Dilemmas,” “Three Perspectives on Marxism,” and “Social Structures and their Threats to Moral Agency.”
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair C., Paul Blackledge, and Neil Davidson. Alasdair MacIntyre's Engagement with Marxism: Selected Writings 1953-1974. Leiden: Brill, 2008. Published in Paperback, Chicago: Haymarket Books, 2009.
    • Paul Blackledge and Neil Davidson’s Introduction differentiates some of the strains in Marxist thought and practice in the 1950s and 1960s and connects MacIntyre to the Campaign for Nuclear Disarmament and the New Left. The 46 Marxist essays in the book reveal consistencies between MacIntyre’s earlier classical Marxism and his later Thomism. The collection includes “Communism and British Intellectuals,” “Freedom and Revolution,” and “Breaking the Chains of Reason.”
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “On Being a Theistic Philosopher in a Secularized Culture.” Proceedings of the American Catholic Philosophical Association 84 (2010): 23–32.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Chapter 5, “Alasdair MacIntyre: The Illusion of Self-sufficiency’ in Conversations on Ethics by Alex Voorheve, Oxford University Press, 2009.
    • Each chapter in this book is an interview with a contemporary moral philosopher.  Alasdair Macintyre calls Chapter 5 “the best short statement of my views in print.”
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. God, Philosophy, Universities: A Selective History of the Catholic Philosophical Tradition. Lanham. MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 2011.
    • This book surveys the history of Catholic philosophical tradition, as a relationship between a practice and the institution that supports it.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair C., and Fran O'Rourke. What happened in and to moral philosophy in the twentieth century?: philosophical essays in honor of Alasdair Macintyre. University of Notre Dame Press, 2013.
    • This festschrift from the 2009 Conference hosted by Fran O’Rourke at University College Dublin in honor of MacIntyre’s eightieth birthday contains MacIntyre’s autobiographical lecture, “On Having Survived The Academic Moral Philosophy of the Twentieth Century,” MacIntyre’s response to the essays in the book, and some comments on moving forward in philosophy.

b. Secondary Works

  • Ballard, Bruce W. Understanding MacIntyre. Lanham, Md.: University Press of America, 2000.
    • This is a brief, basic introduction to MacIntyre’s philosophy from a professor who understands it.
  • Beadle, Ron and Geoff Moore. “MacIntyre on Virtue and Organization.” Organization Studies 27, no. 3 (2006): 323–340.
    • Ron Beadle and Geoff Moore’s groundbreaking essay on MacIntyre’s contribution to organizational theory has been cited widely In the Business Ethics literature and included in Sage’s four volume collection of the best papers in business ethics.
  • Beadle, Ron and Geoff Moore, eds. MacIntyre, Empirics, and Organization, special edition, Philosophy of Management 7 no.1 (2008).
    • The nine articles in this special MacIntyre issue of Philosophy of Management were selected “to illustrate both the range of empirical endeavors that might be animated by MacIntyre’s ideas and the variety of responses his work has provoked among social scientists.”
  • Bielskis, Andrius and Kelvin Knight, eds. Virtue and Economy: Essays on Morality and Markets. London: Ashgate, 2014.
    • This volume includes papers from the 2010 meeting of the International Society for MacIntyrean Enquiry hosted by Andrius Bielskis in Vilnius, Lithuania. Also includes MacIntyre’s essay “The Irrelevance of Ethics,” in which MacIntyre argues that courses in business ethics cannot solve social moral problems; those solutions demand moral formation in habits of justice, and no technical knowledge of moral arguments can make up for the lack of this moral formation.
  • Blackledge, Paul. “Morality and Revolution: Ethical Debates in the British New Left,” Critique 35, no. 2 (August 2007):  211–228.
  • Cunningham, Lawrence S. Intractable Disputes About the Natural Law Alasdair MacIntyre and Critics. Notre Dame, Ind: University of Notre Dame Press, 2009.
    • MacIntyre presents the problem of intractable moral disagreement as it has emerged in his writings since the late 1970s; eight scholars respond and MacIntyre replies.
  • Davenport, John J., Anthony Rudd, Alasdair C. MacIntyre, and Philip L. Quinn. Kierkegaard After MacIntyre: Essays on Freedom, Narrative, and Virtue. Chicago: Open Court, 2001.
    • Twelve essay by respected Kierkegaard specialists take issue MacIntyre’s interpretation of Kierkegaard, published in The Encyclopedia of Philosophy (1968) and in AV (1981). MacIntyre responds.
  • Franks, Joan M., O.P. “Aristotle or Nietzsche.” Listening 26, no. 2 (1991): 156–163.
  • Flew, Antony. “Psycho-Analytic Explanation.” Analysis 10, no. 1 (October 1949).
  • Flew, Antony. Review of Metaphysical Beliefs. The Philosophical Quarterly 8, no. 33 (Oct., 1958): 383-384.
  • George, Robert P. “Moral Particularism, Thomism, and Traditions.” Review of Metaphysics 42 (March 1989): 593–605.
  • Hauerwas, Stanley, and Paul Wadell. Review of After Virtue, by Alasdair MacIntyre. The Thomist 46, no. 2 (April 1982): 313–323.
  • Hibbs, Thomas S. “MacIntyre’s Postmodern Thomism: Reflections on Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry.” The Thomist 57 (1993): 277–297.
  • Hittinger, Russell. Review of After Virtue by Alasdair MacIntyre, The New Scholasticism 56, no. 3 (1982): 385–90.
    • Russell Hittinger wrote a peculiarly insightful book review that connects the achievement of AV to the frustrations of ASIA.
  • Horton, John, and Susan Mendus, eds. After MacIntyre: Critical Perspectives on the Work of Alasdair MacIntyre. Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press, 1994.
    • This is a collection of essays critical of MacIntyre’s work.  It is of mixed quality.  MacIntyre responds.
  • Knight, Kelvin. Aristotelian Philosophy: Ethics and Politics from Aristotle to MacIntyre. Cambridge, UK: Polity, 2007.
    • Kelvin Knight interprets Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics in terms of action and agency, and shows how MacIntyre’s ethics and politics develop these themes. Kelvin Knight is respected internationally as a leading MacIntyre scholar.
  • Kelvin Knight and Paul Blackledge, eds. Revolutionary Aristotelianism (Stuttgart: Lucius & Lucius, 2008), special edition of Analyse & Kritik 30, no. 1 (June 2008).
  • Lutz, Christopher Stephen. Tradition in the Ethics of Alasdair MacIntyre: Relativism, Thomism, and Philosophy. Lanham, Md.: Lexington books, 2004.
    • This general introduction to MacIntyre’s theory of rationality provides a brief intellectual biography and examines the claims of MacIntyre’s critics.
  • Lutz, Christopher Stephen. “Alasdair MacIntyre’s Tradition Constituted Rationality: An Alternative to Relativism and Fideism.” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 85:3 (Summer 2011).
  • Lutz, Christopher Stephen. Reading Alasdair MacIntyre’s AV. New York: Continuum, 2012.
    • This book situates AV in the larger context of MacIntyre’s career, summarizes and comments on the critical and constructive arguments of the book, and discusses the subsequent development of MacIntyre’s work.
  • Maletta, Sante. Biografia della ragione: Saggio sulla filosofia politica di MacIntyre. Rome: Rubbettino, 2007.
  • McMylor, Peter. Alasdair MacIntyre: Critic of Modernity. London: Routledge, 1994.
    • Peter McMylor traces MacIntyre’s development and explains his central theories from a perspective informed by sociology. This book is a valuable complement to philosophically centered readings of MacIntyre’s work.
  • Mitchell, Basil. “The Justification of Religious Belief.” The Philosophical Quarterly 11, No. 44 (Jul., 1961):  213–226.
  • Murphy, Mark C. ed. Alasdair MacIntyre. Contemporary Philosophy in Focus. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
    • Seven excellent essays from respected authors combine to draw a very good picture of the whole project. This is a valuable reference.
  • Nicholas, Jeffery L. Reason, Tradition, and the Good: MacIntyre’s Tradition-Constituted Reason and Frankfurt School Critical Theory. Notre Dame, Ind: University of Notre Dame Press, 2012.
    • Nicholas parallels the concerns of critical theory and those of contemporary Aristotelians and Thomists; in so doing, he offers an opportunity to Aristotelians and critical theorists to engage one another.
  • Nussbaum, Martha Craven. “Recoiling from Reason.” Review of WJWR by Alasdair MacIntyre. New York Review of Books 36, no. 19 (December 7, 1989): 36–41.
    • Nussbaum’s review is a notable example of the nostalgia complaint against MacIntyre’s work on tradition. Her interpretation of MacIntyre is contrary to MacIntyre’s writings on at least two points. First, it disregards his continued rejection of fideism. Second, it treats tradition after the fashion of Burke, Polanyi, or Kuhn, as essentially conservative and essentially unitary. Compare to “Epistemological Crises” in Tasks, p. 16.
  • Perreau-Saussine, Emile. Alasdair MacIntyre: Une Biographie Intellectuelle. Presses Universitaires France, 2005.
  • Perreau-Saussine, Emile. “The Moral Critique of Stalinism,” in Paul Blackledge and Kelvin Knight, eds. Virtue and Politics. pp. 134–151.
  • Perreau-Saussine examines the problem and implications of MacIntyre’s struggle with the moral critique of Stalinism with illuminating insight.
  • Peters, Richard. “Cause, Cure, and Motive.” Analysis 10, no. 5 (April 1950).
  • Reames, Kent. “Metaphysics, History, and Moral Philosophy: The Centrality of the 1990 Aquinas Lecture to MacIntyre’s Argument for Thomism.” The Thomist 62 (1998): 419–443.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. “Knowing How and Knowing That: The Presidential Address. ” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society. New Series, Vol. 46, (1945 - 1946): 1-16.
  • Scheffler, Samuel. Review of AV: A Study in Moral Theory [1st ed.] in The Philosophical Review 92, No. 3 (July 1983): 443–447.
  • Toulmin, Steven. “The Logical Status of Psycho-Analysis.” Analysis 9, no. 2 (December 1948).
  • Wachbroit, Robert. “A Genealogy of Virtues.” Review of AV [1st ed.]. The Yale Law Journal 92 (1983): 564–576.
  • Wachbroit, Robert. “Relativism and Virtue.” The Yale Law Journal 94 (1985): 1559–1565.
  • Wartofsky, Marx. “Virtue Lost or Understanding MacIntyre.” Inquiry 27 (1984): 235–50.
  • Zoll, Patrick. Ethik ohne Letztbegründung?: Zu den nicht-fundamentalistischen Ansätzen von Alasdair MacIntyre und Jeffrey Stout. Würzburg, Deutschland: Verlag Königshausen & Neumann GmbH, 2012.
  • The photograph of MacIntyre appears by permission of the London Metropolitan University.


Author Information

Christopher Stephen Lutz
Saint Meinrad Seminary and School of Theology
U. S. A.

Bertrand Russell: Ethics

russellThis article confines itself to Bertrand Russell's conversion from ethical cognitivism (similar to G. E. Moore) to ethical non-cognitivism (similar to Ayer).  Russell’s conversion is not only historically important, as it contributes to the rise of metaethics, but it also clarifies the central issues between cognitivism and non-cognitivism.

Traditionally, ethics has been understood as a branch of philosophy that focuses on normative value in human conduct; it is the search for a rationally defensible view concerning what things are good (worth aiming at), which actions are right, and why. However, the tradition took a peculiar turn in the context of 20th century analytic philosophy.   Here, philosophers began to focus on the meanings of ethical terms and claims, rather than on the elements of right conduct.   This was the birth of what we nowadays call “metaethics,” over against which the focus on normative theory—the mainstream of Western philosophical ethics from Aristotle to G. E. Moore—has come to be called “normative ethics.   Current fashion divides ethics into three sub branches: normative ethics, metaethics and applied ethics. This distinction became necessary after the rise of metaethics in the first half of the twentieth century. Unlike normative ethics, metaethics mainly concentrates on the meanings of fundamental ethical terms, and on ethical method.

The first mature exposition of Russell's ethical views is found in his essay "The Elements of Ethics" (1910).  “The Elements” expounds an ethics largely based on G. E. Moore's Principia Ethica. When he wrote it, Russell was, like Moore, a cognitivist in ethics.  That is to say, he believed that ethical statements such as "X is good", express propositions that have truth-value (that is, are either true or false) independent of our opinions and emotions. However, the cognitivist phase of Russell's thinking did not last long. Soon he moved from ethical cognitivism to ethical non-cognitivism, which denies that ethical statements have truth-value. The change was mainly brought about by Santayana's criticism of “The Elements” in his book Winds of Doctrine (1913).

An exposition of Russell's ethical non-cognitivism in its developed form is found in Religion and Science (1935). This was published one year before A. J. Ayer's Language, Truth and Logic, which was to become the most famous exposition of ethical non-cognitivism in the first half of the twentieth century. There are two aspects of Russell's ethical ideas as expressed in Religion and Science: (1) that ethical statements are not fact-stating though they seem to be so when expressed in indicative mood, and (2) they are optative or desire expressing.

Russell's final ethical views are to be found in Human Society in Ethics and Politics (1954), which might be regarded as Russell's most important ethical writing. In Human Society, Russell adopts as his guiding principle David Hume's maxim, "Reason is, and ought, only to be the slave of the passions.”

Table of Contents

  1. Writings on Ethics
  2. Russell's Concept of Ethics
  3. Evolution of Russell's Ethical Ideas
    1. Adolescent View
    2. Philosophical Essays
    3. Transition from Cognitivism to Non-Cognitivism
    4. What I Believe
    5. An Outline of Philosophy
    6. Religion and Science
    7. Human Society in Ethics and Politics
  4. Russell, Ayer and Subsequent Ethics
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Writings on Ethics

Bertrand Russell was a prolific writer. He wrote on different branches of philosophy, including logic, epistemology, metaphysics, ethics, social and political philosophy, philosophy of religion and philosophy of mathematics. His three most important ethical writings are "The Elements of Ethics" (1910), Religion and Science (1935), and Human Society in Ethics and Politics (1954). In "The Elements" Russell expounds an ethics largely based on G. E. Moore's Principia Ethica. An exposition of Russell's ethical non-cognitivism in its developed form is found in Religion and Science, whereas Russell's final ethical views are to be found in Human Society in Ethics and Politics, which might be regarded as his most important ethical writing. Russell had originally intended to include the discussion on ethics in his Human Knowledge, but he decided not to do so because he was uncertain as to the sense in which ethics can be regarded as "knowledge.”

Apart from the works mentioned above, What I Believe (1925), An Outline of Philosophy (1927), "Reply to Criticism" in The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell (1946) and Bertrand Russell Speaks His Mind (1960) contain valuable material on Russell's ethics.

2. Russell's Concept of Ethics

Except for a short time as a cognitivist under the influence of G. E. Moore, Russell was consistently an ethical non-cognitivist.  That is to say, he did not believe that there is any such thing as objective ethical facts:  “When we assert that this or that has ‘value’”, says Russell, "we are giving expression to our own emotions, not to a fact which would still be true if our personal feelings were different." (Russell 1949, 230-31)   This perspective has important implications for his concept of Ethics as a philosophical sub-discipline, and as a purported field of knowledge.  In both cases, Russell thinks Ethics fails to qualify.

In his An Outline of Philosophy, Russell begins his discussion of ethics with the following words: "Ethics is traditionally a department of philosophy, and that is my reason for discussing it. I hardly think myself that it ought to be included in the domain of philosophy, but to prove this would take as long as to discuss the subject itself, and would be less interesting." (180)  Russell's reasons for excluding ethics from the domain of philosophy become clearer in his Religion and Science.  Because of his non-cogntivism, Russell thinks that questions as to "values"—that is to say, as to what is good or bad on its own account, independently of its effects—lie outside the domain of science.  From this, Russell draws the further conclusion that questions about "values" lie wholly outside the domain of knowledge. And this in turn has implications for the place of Ethics in philosophy.

Russell regarded philosophy as a kind of incomplete science, a search for certainty in the sphere where certain knowledge is not yet achieved but remains possible. However, since Russell rejects the existence of ethics facts, ethical knowledge (certain or otherwise) is not even possible.   Therefore, while Russell regarded the argument proving the impossibility of ethical knowledge as part of philosophy, normative theory—the traditional business of philosophical ethics—was excluded from philosophy proper.  Thus, although Russell originally intended to include his Human Society in Ethics and Politics in his book Human Knowledge, as he says in the preface to the former, he decided not to do so because he was uncertain as to the sense in which ethics can be regarded as "knowledge.”

In his "Reply to Criticism" in The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell, Russell reaffirms this view, repeating that he would like to exclude all value judgments from philosophy "except that this would be too violent a breach with usage, " (719), and insisting that the only matter concerned with ethics that can be "properly" regarded as belonging to philosophy is the argument that ethical propositions should be expressed in optative mood, not in the indicative.

3. Evolution of Russell's Ethical Ideas

The main shift in his ethical thinking was from ethical cognitivism (similar to G. E. Moore) to non-cognitivism (similar to Ayer), but Russell's ethical ideas did not remain the same throughout his philosophical career.

a. Adolescent View

In his youth, Russell took the utilitarian view that the "happiness of mankind should be the aim of all actions" (Russell 1978, 39) to be so obviously true that he was surprised to find, upon entering Cambridge, that there were alternative ethical theories.  At this stage, he took "the greatest happiness of the greatest number" as his ideal.

Russell moved away from his youthful utilitarianism because of what he calls "moral experience.” (Russell 1978, 161)

According to Russell, circumstances are apt to generate perfectly concrete moral convictions, and it is often impossible to judge beforehand what one's moral opinion of a fact will be.

In a letter written to Gilbert Murray in 1902, Russell says, "what first turned me away from utilitarinism was the persuasion that I myself ought to pursue philosophy, although I had (and have still) no doubt that by doing economics and the theory of politics I could add more to human happiness." It appeared to Russell that the dignity of which human existence is capable is not attainable by "devotion to the mechanism of life", and that unless the contemplation of "eternal things" is preserved, humankind will become "no better than well-fed pigs.” However, Russell did not believe that such contemplation overall tends to happiness. As he says, "it gives moments of delight, but these are outweighed by years of effort and depression.” (Russell 1978, 161)

b. Philosophical Essays

The first mature exposition of Russell's ethical views is found in "The Elements of Ethics," an essay in his book Philosophical Essays (1910). In "The Elements" Russell expounds an ethics largely based on G. E. Moore's Principia Ethica.

He believed that (1) "good" is the most fundamental ethical concept and (2) that "good" is indefinable. He further maintained that we know a priori certain propositions about the kind of things that are good on their own account. In addition, that when we make a statement such as "X is good", we make a statement like "this table is round", which is either true or false, and whose truth or falsity is independent of our opinions and emotions. So, at the time of writing "The Elements" Russell was, like Moore, a cognitivist in ethics.

According to Moore, the pleasure of human intercourse and the enjoyment of beautiful objects are the most valuable things we know or imagine. Russell, on the other hand, gives no such list of things which are good in themselves, since he holds that his readers are competent to judge what things are good and what bad.

Roughly speaking, Russell's conception of "right" in "The Elements" is also the same as that of Moore's conception of right or duty. Irrespective of details, both Moore and Russell regard consequences or results as of vital importance for judging an action as right or wrong. In other words both are teleologists or consequentialists, like the utilitarians.

Russell, however, also allows for what he calls a "subjective" sense of “right.” According to Russell, if a person asks himself, "what ought I to do?" and then acts on his answer, that is to say, what he or she judges to be right after an appropriate amount of candid thought—the appropriate amount of thought being dependent on the difficulty and importance of the decision—then he may be regarded as acting rightly in the subjective sense, even if his action is not objectively right. An action is called "objectively right" by Russell when "of all that are possible it is the one which will probably have the best results.” Moore, on the other hand, makes no such distinction between right in the subjective sense and right in the objective sense.

c. Transition from Cognitivism to Non-Cognitivism

The cognitivist phase of Russell's thinking did not last long. Soon he started moving from ethical cognitivism to ethical non-cognitivism. The change was mainly brought about by Santayana's criticism of Russell's "The Elements" in the former’s book Winds of Doctrine (1913). The main thrust of Santayana's criticism was that "good" cannot be totally independent of human interests and feelings; and that propositions about intrinsic goodness—if they can be called propositions at all—cannot be true or false in a manner in which propositions in physical sciences are, because they are not statements about certain objective state of affairs but are only expressions of "preferences we feel." As he says, "to speak of the truth of an ultimate good would be a false collocation of terms; an ultimate good is chosen, found or aimed at; it is not opined.” (Santayana 1913, 143-44)

Santayana is also at pains to emphasize that "good" cannot be totally independent of human interests and feelings. As he says, "For the human system whiskey is truly more intoxicating than coffee, and the contrary opinion would be an error; but what a strange way of vindicating this real, though relative distinction to insist that whiskey is more intoxicating in itself, without reference to any animal; that it is pervaded, as it were, by an inherent intoxication, and stands dead drunk in its bottle!" (Jager 1972, 473)

Another factor, apart from Santayana's criticism, which stimulated the change in Russell's ethical thinking, was the impact of the First World War, which Russell passionately opposed. The war forced him to think afresh on a number of fundamental questions. For instance, Russell was forced to revise his views on human nature. As he says in his Autobiography, in his endeavour to understand popular feelings about war, he arrived at a view of human passions similar to that of psychoanalysts. Russell started believing that fundamental facts "in all ethical questions are feelings", (Russell 1917, 19) and that impulse has more effect in moulding human lives than conscious purpose.

d. What I Believe

The second published work to discuss Russell’s ethics in some detail is What I Believe (1925). In this small book, included in The Basic Writings of Bertrand Russell, Russell clearly says that ethical disagreements about the good life are amenable to argument only when men differ as to the means to achieve a given end. But when there is a real difference as to ends, no argument is possible. "I cannot, therefore," says Russell, "prove that my view of the good life is right; I can only state my view, and hope that as many as possible will agree." (Egner and Dennon 1961, 372)

Russell's view is that the good life is one inspired by love and guided by knowledge. According to Russell, neither love without knowledge nor knowledge without love can produce a good life; but love is in a sense more fundamental, since it will lead intelligent people to seek knowledge in order to find out how to benefit those whom they love.

Russell clarifies that by "knowledge" he does not mean "ethical knowledge.” (In fact, he did not believe that there is, strictly speaking, any such knowledge.) By "knowledge" Russell means "scientific knowledge and knowledge of particular facts." (374) He considers such knowledge important, because if we desire to achieve some end, knowledge may show us the means, and this knowledge, according to Russell, may loosely pass as "ethical.” "Given an end to be achieved," says Russell, "it is a question for science to discover how to achieve it. All moral rules must be tested by examining whether they tend to realize ends that we desire."(374)

So, Russell is already linking "good" with the desired, a theme to which, as we shall see, he returns again and again. He says emphatically "outside human desires there is no moral standard." (375)

e. An Outline of Philosophy

In An Outline of Philosophy, Russell approaches the problem of ethics with the question, "What is meant when a person says 'You ought to do so-and-so' or ' I ought to do so-and-so'?" and gives the reply that "primarily a sentence of this sort has an emotional content"; it means "this is the act towards which I feel the emotion of approval.” However, Russell notes, "we do not wish to leave the matter there; we want to find something more objective and systematic and constant than a personal emotion." (181)

Russell points out that when the ethical teacher says, "you ought to approve acts of such-and-such kinds," he generally gives reasons for his view, and proceeds to examine "what sorts of reasons are possible." (181)

In this context, Russell refers to the utilitarian doctrine that happiness is the good and we ought to act so as to maximize the balance of happiness over unhappiness in the world, and says: "I should not myself regard happiness as an adequate definition of the good, but I should agree that conduct ought to be judged by its consequences." According to Russell, "right conduct" is not an autonomous concept, but means "conduct calculated to produce desirable results." This leads him to ask, "How can we discover what constitutes the ends of right conduct?"

At this point Russell, first, refers to the fact that on this issue he earlier held views similar to those of G. E. Moore, which he was led to abandon "partly by Mr. Santayana's Winds of Doctrine." And then he declares, "I now think that good and bad are derivative from desire." He points out that there is a conflict between desires of different men and incompatible desires of the same man and says that good is "mainly a social concept, designed to find an issue from this conflict."(183-84)

Thus, two things are clear. First, Russell, when he wrote What I Believe and An Outline of Philosophy had ceased to be a cognitivist. Second,  he had now started moving towards the view that good was a social concept derived from desire. However, in these two books we find only a rough outline of a new theory that is emerging. We find an exposition of Russell's non-cognitivism in more developed form in Religion and Science.

f. Religion and Science

An exposition of Russell's ethical non-cognitivism in its developed form is found in Religion and Science (1935), which was published one year before A. J. Ayer's exposition of the emotivist theory of ethics in Language, Truth and Logic. Russell retains his view from "The Elements" that defining "good" is the fundamental problem of ethics. According to him, once "good" is defined, the rest of ethics follows: we ought to act in the way we believe most likely to create as much good as possible, and as little of its correlative evil. In other words, once we define "good", framing of moral rules is a matter for science.

However, Russell argues that when we try to be definite as to what we mean by "good", we land ourselves in great difficulties, because—unlike with scientific questions—there is no factual evidence about value. Disputants can only appeal to their own emotions, and employ rhetorical devices to rouse similar emotions in others. According to Russell, when we assert that this or that has value, we are giving expression to our emotions, not to a fact which would still be true if our personal feelings were different. When a person says "this is good in itself," he seems to be making a statement like "this is square" or "this is sweet.” Nevertheless, what he really means, according to Russell, is "I wish everybody to desire this" or "Would that everybody desire this.” (235)  The first of these sentences, which may be true or false, does not, says Russell, belong to ethics but to psychology or biography. The second sentence which does belong to ethics, expresses a desire for something, but asserts nothing; and since it asserts nothing it is logically impossible that there should be evidence for or against it, or for it to possess either truth or falsehood.

In sum, there are two main aspects to Russell’s metaethical views in Religion  and Science.  First, ethical statements are not fact-stating (though they seem to be so when expressed in indicative mood).  Second, they are instead optative, or desire-expressing. This link between “good” and desire is already familiar from An Outline of Philosophy.  Prima facie, according to Russell, anything we all desire is good and anything we all dread is bad. If we all agreed in our desires, says Russell, the matter could be left there, but in fact, desires of human beings conflict. In this conflict each tries to enlist allies by showing that his own desires harmonize with those of other people. Therefore, ethics, according to Russell, is closely related to politics: it is an attempt to bring the collective desires of group to bear upon individuals and, conversely, it is an attempt by an individual to cause his desires to become those of his group. In this way, according to Russell, ethics contains no statement whether true or false, but consists of desires of a certain general kind, namely, such as are concerned with desires of humankind in general.

g. Human Society in Ethics and Politics

Russell's final ethical views are to be found in Human Society in Ethics and Politics (1954), which might be regarded as his most important ethical work. As he says in the preface of the Human Society, he originally intended to include the discussion of ethics in his book Human Knowledge, but he decided not to do so, because he was uncertain as to the sense in which ethics can be regarded as "knowledge.” The book, Russell claimed, has two purposes: first, to set forth an undogmatic ethic; and second, to apply this ethic to various current political problems.

Russell adopts as his guiding principle David Hume's maxim that "Reason is, and ought, only to be the slave of the passions.” According to Russell, desires, emotions or passions are the only possible causes of action. Reason is not a cause of action but only a regulator. "The world that I should wish to see," says Russell, 'is one where emotions are strong but not destructive, and where, because they are acknowledged, they lead to no deception either of oneself or of others. Such a world would include love and friendship and the pursuit of art and knowledge." (11)

In effect, what Russell says in Human Society, is not very different from what he says in Religion and Science; when an ethical disagreement is about means for achieving certain ends, it can be resolved by the use of reason; but when the disagreement is about ends reason is of no help, because what ends we pursue depends ultimately on our desires.

As in Religion and Science, Russell is also at pains to emphasize that our desires are not "irrational" just because we cannot give any reason for them. According to Russell, a desire cannot, in itself, be either rational or irrational. We may desire A because it is a means to B, but in the end, when we have done with mere means we must come to something, which we desire for no reasons. Nevertheless, the desire cannot be called irrational merely because no reasons can be given for feeling it.

However, Russell's dissatisfaction with his own theory of ethics, which earlier finds an expression in "Reply to Criticism" (1946) reappears in Human Society and we find him wondering once again whether there is such a thing as ethical knowledge. In an important passage he says: "It may be that there is some … way of arriving at objectivity in ethics; if so, since it must involve appeal to the majority, it will take us from personal ethics into the sphere of politics, which is, in fact, very difficult to separate from ethics."(26-27)

Russell sums up his efforts to arrive at an objective ethics in the following fundamental propositions and definitions:

(1) Surveying the acts which arouse emotions of approval or disapproval, we find that, as a general rule, the acts which are approved of are those believed likely to have, on the balance, effects of certain kinds while opposite effects are expected from acts that are disapproved of.

(2) Effects that lead to approval are defined as "good" and those leading to disapproval are as "bad.”

 (3) An act of which, on the available evidence, the effects are likely to be better than those of any other act that is possible in the circumstances, is defined as "right"; any other act is "wrong.” What we "ought" to do is, by definition, the act which is right.

(4) It is right to feel approval of a right act and disapproval of a wrong act. (115-16)

According to Russell, these definitions and propositions, if accepted, provide a coherent body of ethical propositions, which are true (or false) in the same sense as if they were propositions of science. He admits that different societies in different ages have given approval to a wide diversity of acts; but, argues Russell, the difference between ourselves and other ages in these respects is attributable to a difference between our beliefs and theirs as to the effects of actions. Thus, Russell is led to the conclusion that there is more agreement among humankind as to the effects that we should aim than as to the kinds of acts that are approved. "I think", he says, " the contention of Henry Sidgwick, that acts which are approved of are those that are likely to bring happiness or pleasure, is, broadly speaking, true.” (117)

If it is admitted, Russell points out, that the great majority of approved acts are such as are believed to have certain effects, and it is found, further, that exceptional acts, which are approved without having this character, tend to be no longer approved when their exceptional character is realized; then it becomes possible, in a certain sense, to speak of ethical error. We may say, according to Russell, that it is "wrong" to approve of such exceptional acts, meaning that such approval does not have the effects which mark the great majority of approved acts.

Although on the above theory, ethics contains statements, which are true or false, and not merely optative or imperative, Russell points out that its basis is still one of emotion and feeling. The emotion of approval is involved in the definition of "right" and "wrong" and the feeling of enjoyment or satisfaction is involved in the definition of "good" or "intrinsic value.” Thus, according to Russell, the appeal upon which we depend for the acceptance of our ethical theory is not the appeal to the facts of perception, but to emotions and feelings, which have given rise to the concepts of "right" and "wrong", "good" and "bad.”

Interestingly, in his Autobiography, Russell summarizes his conclusion in Human Society in Ethics and Politics in the following manner: "The conclusion that I reach is that ethics is never an independent constituent, but is reducible to politics in the last analysis." (523) He reiterates that there is no such thing as ethical knowledge, and that "reason is, and ought only to be, the slave of the passions." An ethical opinion, maintains Russell, can only be defended by an ethical axiom, but if the axiom is not accepted, there is no way of reaching a rational conclusion.

There is, according to Russell, one approximately rational approach to ethics, which he calls "the doctrine of compossibility.” Russell defines "compossible desires” as desires which can be satisfied together, that is, those which do not conflict with one another. According to the doctrine of compossibility, the person who wishes to be happy should try to guide his life by the largest possible set of compossible desires. Similarly, a world in which the aims of different individuals or groups is compossible is likely to be happier than one in which they are conflicting. Therefore, says Russell, it should be part of a wise social system to encourage compossible purposes and discourage conflicting ones, by means of education and social systems designed to this end. However, Russell feels that from a theoretical point of view this doctrine affords no ultimate solution, because it assumes that happiness is better than unhappiness, which, according to him, is an ethical principle incapable of proof.

Two things emerge out of this survey of Russell's ethical thinking: (i) Russell's concept of "right" remains largely the same throughout his career, and that concept is, broadly speaking, utilitarian: right action is that action which leads to good results; (ii) though Russell consistently regards "good" as the most fundamental ethical concept, his view of what good is or whether we can know at all what good is changes over time. However, his final ethical views on this issue are much closer to utilitarianism than to any other classical ethical theory, as is shown by his approval of Sidgwick's contention  that "acts which are approved of are those that are likely to bring happiness or pleasure.” In place of classical utilitarianism’s "happiness", Russell prefers to speak of "satisfaction of desires.” In Human Society itself, for example, Russell defines "good" as "satisfaction of desire.” According to him, this definition is more consonant with the ethical feelings of the majority of humankind than any other theoretically defensible definition.

4. Russell, Ayer and Subsequent Ethics

As we have seen, the main shift in Russell's ethical thinking was from cognitivism to non-cognitivism. Russell shares this non-cognitivist perspective with ethical thinkers such as A. J. Ayer, C. L. Stevenson, R. M Hare and P. H. Nowell-Smith. The common core of non-cognitivism is the denial that ethical claims have factual contents and corresponding truth-values.  However, when non-cogntivists turn from telling us what ethical statements are not to telling us what they are, they frequently differ from one another in many of the details.  Russell’s non-cogntivism differs from other versions in several ways.

First, Russell’s positive account of ethical statements focuses mainly on desires. Therefore, his analysis of ethical terms is more appropriately described as optative than, for example, emotive (Ayer, Stevenson) or prescriptive (Hare).

Second, Russell's optative analysis of ethical terms applies mainly to "good" (as an end), which Russell regarded as the most fundamental ethical term. As far as the analysis of "right" is concerned, Russell was a consequentialist throughout his philosophical career.

Third, Russell shows a greater awareness than many non-cognitivists of his era of the social importance or social function of ethical concepts. For example, he clearly says in An Outline of Philosophy that "good" is mainly a social concept "designed to find an issue" [that is, an outcome, a resolution] from conflict of desires—between desires of different persons, and incompatible desires of the same person. He also adds that the primary use of “good” is to label things we individually desire, but, since language is a social institution, “good” gradually comes to apply to things desired by the whole social group.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Egner, Robert E. and Dennon, Lester E. (ed.), The Basic Writings of Bertrand Russell (New York: Simon and Schuster, 1961)
  • Russell, Bertrand, An Outline of Philosophy (London: Unwin Paperbacks, 1979)
  • Russell, Bertrand, Human Society in Ethics and Politics (London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1954)
  • Russell, Bertrand, Justice in Wartime (Nottingham: Spokesman Books, 1917)
  • Russell, Bertrand, Philosophical Essays (New York: Simon and Schuster, 1966)
  • Russell, Bertrand, Religion and Science (London: Oxford University Press, 1949) Russell, Bertrand, Bertrand Russell Speaks His Mind (London: Arthur Barker, 1961)
  • Russell, Bertrand, The Autobiography of Bertrand Russell (London: Unwin Paperbacks, 1978)

b. Secondary Sources

  • Ayer, A. J., Language, Truth and Logic (England: Penguin Books Ltd., 1976)
  • Jager, Ronald, The Development of Bertrand Russell's Philosophy (London:
  • George Allen and Unwin, 1972)
  • Moore, G. E., Principia Ethica (London: Cambridge university Press, 1965)
  • Nath, Ramendra, The Ethical Philosophy of Bertrand Russell (New York: Vantage Press, 1993)
  • Pigden, Charles R., Russell on Ethics: Selections from Writings of Bertrand Russell (London and New York: Routledge, 1999)
  • Potter, Michael K., Bertrand Russell's Ethics (London and New York: Continuum, 2006)
  • Santayana, G., Winds of Doctrine (London: J. M. Dent & Sons Ltd. 1913)
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur (ed.), The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell (Evaston, Illinois: The Library of Living Philosophers Inc., 1946)


Author Information

Ramendra Nath
Patna University

Rights and Obligations of Parents

Historically, philosophers have had relatively little to say about the family. This is somewhat surprising, given the pervasive presence and influence of the family upon both individuals and social life. Most philosophers who have addressed issues related to the parent-child relationship—Kant and Aristotle, for example—have done so in a fairly terse manner. At the end of the twentieth century, this changed. Contemporary philosophers have begun to explore, in a substantial way, a range of issues connected with the rights and obligations of parents. For example, if there are parental rights, what is their foundation? Most contemporary philosophers reject the notion that children are there parents' property and thus reject the notions that parents have rights to their children and over their children. Some philosophers argue for a biological basis of parental rights, while others focus on the best interests of children or a social contract as the grounds of such rights. Still others reject outright the notion that parents have rights, as parents. Some do so because of skepticism about the structure of the putative rights of parents, while others reject the idea of parental rights in view of the nature and extent of the rights of children.

The claim that parents have obligations, as parents, is less controversial. Nevertheless, there is disagreement about the basis of such obligations. Apart from biological, best interests, and social contract views, there is also the causal view of parental obligations, which includes the claim that those who bring a child into existence are thereby obligated to care for that child. Philosophers are concerned not merely with these theoretical questions related to parental rights and obligations; they also focus their attention on practical questions in this realm of human life. There are many distinct positions to consider with respect to medical decision making, the autonomy of children, child discipline, the licensing of parents, and the propriety of different forms of moral, political, and religious upbringing of children. While both the theoretical and practical aspects of the rights and obligations of parents are receiving increased attention, there remains much room for substantial work to be done on this important topic.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Philosophical Accounts of Parental Rights and Obligations
    1. Proprietarianism
    2. Biology
    3. Best Interests of the Child
    4. Constructionism
    5. Causation
    6. Fundamental Interests of Parents and Children
  3. Skepticism about Parental Rights and Obligations
    1. Children’s Liberation
    2. The Myth of Parental Rights
  4. Applied Parental Ethics
    1. Parental Licensing
    2. The Child’s Right to an Open Future
    3. Medical Decision Making
    4. Disciplining Children
    5. The Religious Upbringing of Children
    6. Parental Love
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

What is a parent? The answer one gives to this question will likely include, either implicitly or explicitly, particular assumptions about the grounds of parental rights and obligations. Parenthood and biological parenthood are often seen as synonymous. But of course, adoptive parents are also parents by virtue of assuming the parental role. This commonsense fact opens the door for a consideration not only of the possible connections between biology and parenthood, but other issues as well, such as the role of consent in acquiring parental rights and obligations, which then leads to a host of other questions that are not only theoretically important, but existentially significant as well. What does it mean for a parent to possess rights, as a parent? Why think that such rights exist? What obligations do parents have to their children? What is the role of the state, if any, concerning the parent-child relationship? These questions are central for our understanding of the moral, social, personal, and political dimensions of the parent-child relationship.

2. Philosophical Accounts of Parental Rights and Obligations

When considering the rights of parents, both positive and negative rights are involved. A negative right is a right of non-interference, such as the right to make medical decisions on behalf of one’s child without intervention from the state. A positive right in this context is a right to have the relevant interests one has as a parent in some way promoted by the state. For example, some argue that parents have a right to maternity and paternity leave, funded in part or whole by the state. Regarding parental obligations, the focus in what follows will be on moral obligations, rather than legal ones, with a few exceptions. A parent might have a moral obligation to her child to provide her with experiences such as musical education or opportunities to participate in sports that enrich her life, without being legally bound to do so. In this section, the various accounts of the grounds of the moral rights and obligations of parents will be discussed.

a. Proprietarianism

An advocate of proprietarianism holds that children are the property of their parents, and that this serves to ground parental rights (and perhaps obligations). Proprietarianists argue, given that parents in some sense produce their children, that children are the property of their parents in some sense of the term.. Aristotle held this type of view, insofar as he takes children and slaves to be property of the father (Nicomachean Ethics, 1134b). At least one contemporary philosopher, Jan Narveson, has argued that children are the property of their parents, and that this grounds parental rights. This does not relieve parents of having obligations regarding their children even though children do not yet possess rights (Narveson 1988). For Narveson, how parents treat their children is limited by how that treatment impacts other rights-holders. Nevertheless, parents have the right to direct the lives of their children, because they exerted themselves as producers, bringing children into existence. A different sort of proprietarianism centers on the idea that parents own themselves, including their genetic material, and since children are a product of that material it follows that parents have rights over their genetic offspring. Critics of proprietarianism primarily reject it on the grounds that it is immoral to conceive of children as property. Children are human beings, and as such, cannot rightly be owned by other human beings. It follows from this that children are not the property of their parents. Most contemporary philosophers reject proprietarianism.

Historically, proprietarianism is often connected with absolutism, which is the idea that parental authority over children is in an important sense, limitless. Absolutists held that fathers have the right to decide whether or not their child lives or dies. This view is no longer advocated in the contemporary philosophical literature, of course, but in the past was thought by some that this extreme level of parental authority was morally justified. Some advocates of this view thought that because a child is the creation of the parent, that absolutism follows. Other reasons offered in support of this view include the notion that both divine and natural law grant such authority to parents; this level of authority fosters moral development in the young by preventing them from exemplifying vice; and the idea that the family is a model of the commonwealth, such that as children obey their father, they will also learn to obey the commonwealth (Bodin 1576/1967). According to Bodin The natural affection that fathers have towards their children will prevent them from abusing their authority,. Critics of absolutism reject it for reasons similar to those offered against proprietarianism. They claim that is clearly immoral to grant parents the power to end the lives of their children. While some absolutists seek to ground this power in the fact that the parent created the child in question, critics argue that the possession and exercise of this power over one’s children simply does not follow from the fact that one created those children.

b. Biology

Is a biological relationship between a parent and child necessary or sufficient for parenthood? That is, does biology in some sense ground the rights and obligations of parents? Two types of biological accounts of parenthood have emerged which are more detailed than those which emphasize the general value of biology in the parent-child relationship. Advocates of the first type emphasize the genetic connection between parent and child, while advocates of the second take gestation to be crucial. The advocates of the genetic account believe that the genetic connection between parent and child grounds parenthood. The fact that a particular child is derived from the genetic material of an individual or is “tied by blood” to that individual is what yields parental rights and obligations. A person has rights and obligations with respect to a particular child insofar as that person and the child share the requisite DNA. Historically speaking, perceived blood ties have been decisive in the transfer of wealth, property, and power from one generation to the next.

Critics of genetic accounts claim that several of the arguments advanced for these accounts are flawed in important ways. For instance, those who hold that the genetic connection is necessary for parental rights and obligations must deal with counterexamples to the claim, such as adoptive parenthood and step-parenthood. In addition, if two adults who are identical twins have the same level of genetic connection to a child it does not follow that both are that child’s mother or father, though at least some genetic accounts would seem committed to such a view.

Gestational accounts of parental rights and obligations, in their strongest from, include the claim that gestation is necessary for parental rights. On this view, men only acquire parental rights and obligations via marriage, the gestational mother consenting to co-parenthood with the male, or by the mother allowing him to adopt her child. Some gestational accounts—including those which only include the claim that gestation is sufficient for parental rights or gives the mother a prima facie claim to such rights—focus on the risk, effort, and discomfort that gestational mothers undergo as that which grounds their claims to parenthood. Others center on the intimacy that obtains and the attachment which occurs during gestation between the mother and child as the basis for a claim to parenthood. A final type of gestationalism is consequentialist, insofar as advocates of this view hold that when there is a conflict concerning custody between gestational and genetic mothers, a social and legal policy favoring gestational mother will have more favorable consequences for mothers and their children. It is argued that an emphasis on gestation, and preference for gestational mothers in such cases, would increase women’s social standing by emphasizing their freedom to make such choices concerning health on behalf of themselves and their children. This in turn will have the likely result of benefitting the health and welfare of such mothers and their children. Positive inducements are preferable to punitive sanctions, given the positive consequences of the former. This view also implies that the claims to parenthood of gestational mothers carry more weight than those of fathers, at least when disputes over custody arise.

Critics of gestationalism reply that it is objectionably counterintuitive, insofar as it is inconsistent with the belief that mothers and fathers have equal rights and obligations regarding their children. Many of the goods available to individuals via parenthood, including intimacy, meaning, and satisfaction that can be obtained or acquired in the parent-child relationship, are equally available to both mothers and fathers. This equality of parental interests, then, is thought to justify the conclusion that the presumptive claims to parenthood on the parts of mothers and fathers are equal in weight.

There is a more general issue concerning the relationship between biology and parenthood, which has to do with the value of biological connections in the parent-child relationship. A particularly strong view concerning the relationship between biology and parenthood is that biology is essential to the value of parenthood for human beings (Page 1984). On this view, there is a necessary connection between biology and parental rights. The entire process of creating, bearing, and rearing a child is thought to be a single process which is valuable to parents insofar as they seek to create a person who in some sense reflects a part of themselves. The aim is to create someone else in the image of the parent. This is why being a parent has value for us; it is why we desire it. In reply, it has been argued that while biology may have value for many people with respect to the parent-child relationship, a biological connection is neither necessary nor sufficient for parental rights and obligations. Rather, the more valuable aspects of the parent-child relationship are personal, social, and moral. It has been argued that biological ties between parents and children are morally significant in other ways (Velleman 2005). Some believe that children have families in the most important sense of the term if they will be raised by parents who want them, love them, and desire what is best for them, regardless of whether a biological connection exists. The lack of such a connection does little harm to children in such families. Against this, Velleman argues that knowledge of one’s biological relatives, especially one’s parents, is crucial because the self-knowledge one gains from knowing them is central for forging a meaningful human life. Lack of such knowledge, then, is harmful to children. In reply, it has been argued that knowledge of one’s biological progenitors is unnecessary for self-knowledge and for having and leading a good life (Haslanger 2009).

c. Best Interests of the Child

According to this account of parenthood, children ought to be raised by a parent or parents who will best serve their interests. On this account, parental rights are grounded in the ability of parents to provide the best possible context for childrearing. While the best interests criterion of parenthood is useful in cases of conflicting claims to custody in the context of divorce or in situations where child abuse and neglect are present, several criticisms have emerged with respect to its application as the fundamental grounding of parental rights and obligations. One criticism of this view is that it fails to sufficiently take into account the interests of parents, which leads to potential counterexamples. For instance, consider a case in which it is in the best interests of a child to be raised by an aunt or uncle, rather than the child’s biological or custodial parents, when the current parents are fit and fulfilling their obligations to the child in question. Removing the child from the custody of those parents solely on the basis of the comparative superiority of others seems problematic to many. Moreover, this account may entail that the state should remove newborns from the custody of their parents, if they are poor, and transfer parental rights to someone who has greater financial stability, all else being equal. For critics of the best interests account, this is deeply counterintuitive and is sufficient for rejecting this account of parenthood.

Perhaps the account can be modified to deal with such criticisms. The modified account need not entail that a child should be removed from the custody of its natural parents and given to better caretakers, who then possess parental rights with respect to that child, even if these caretakers possess the same nationality, ethnicity, and social origins. This is because it is in the best interests of the child to maintain her developing self-identity and provide her with a stable environment. Still, a primary objection to all best-interests accounts is that they fail to take into account, in an adequate manner, the relevant interests of a child’s current parents. The point is not that parental interests trump the interests of the child, but rather that best interests of the child accounts fail to weigh those interests in a proper manner.

d. Constructionism

Some philosophers argue that the rights and obligations of parenthood are not grounded in biology or a natural relationship between parents and their offspring. Rather, they hold that the rights and obligations of parents are social constructs. One form of this view includes the claim that parenthood is a type of social contract. Advocates of such a view argue that the rights and responsibilities of parenthood arise from a social agreement between the prospective parent and the moral community (such as the state) that appoints the prospective parent to be the actual parent. In some cases, social contract accounts emphasize causation (see section e. below) as a way in which individuals may implicitly consent to taking on the rights and responsibilities of parenthood. Contractual and causal accounts can come apart, however, and be treated separately. It has also been argued that social conventions have priority over biological ties when determining who will raise a child, and that in social contexts where biological parents generally have the duty to raise their offspring, individual responsibility for children is produced by the choice to undertake the duties of raising a child, which can occur by deciding to procreate or deciding not to avoid parental obligations via abortion or adoption.

Others who take parenthood to be a social construct emphasize the individual choice to undertake the rights and responsibilities of parenthood with respect to a particular child. This way of incurring special obligations is familiar. For instance, an employer takes on special obligations to another when that person becomes her employee. Spouses take on special obligations to one another and acquire certain rights with respect to each other via marriage. In these and many other instances, one acquires particular rights and obligations by choice, or voluntary consent. Similarly, then, when an individual voluntarily undertakes the parental role, that individual acquires parental rights and obligations. This can happen via intentional procreation, adoption, and step-parenthood.

Critics of constructionism argue that advocates of this view fail to appreciate certain facts of human nature related to the interests of children. Many constructionists, according to their critics, tend to weigh the interests of adults more heavily than those of the relevant children. They maintain that children have deep and abiding interests in being raised by their biological progenitors, or at least having significant relationships with them. Intentionally creating children who will lack such connections seems problematic, and some critics are especially concerned about intentionally creating children who will lack either a custodial mother or father. Other versions of constructionism are not vulnerable to this critique, insofar as they include the claim that children’s interests and in some cases rights are at least equally important relative to the rights and interests of adults.

Related to the use of reproductive technology, the creation of a child by gamete donors is thought by some to be immoral or at least morally problematic because such donors often fail to take their obligations to their genetic offspring seriously enough when they transfer them to the child’s custodial parents. Given that parental obligations include more than just minimal care, but also seeking to care for children in deeper ways which foster their flourishing, the claim is that in such cases donors do not take their obligations as seriously as is warranted. Constructionists reply that as long as the custodial parents nurture and provide sufficient care for children, the biological connections as well as the presence of both a mother and father are at least relatively, if not entirely, insignificant. In order to resolve these issues, both philosophical argumentation and empirical data are important.

e. Causation

Most, if not all, contemporary philosophers who defend a causal account of parenthood focus on parental obligations rather than rights. Simply stated, the claim is that individuals have special obligations to those offspring which they cause to come into existence. Defenders of the causal account argue that genetic and gestational parents incur moral obligations to their offspring in virtue of their causal role concerning the existence of the children in question. In many cases, of course, the causal parents of a child would incur obligations because they voluntarily consent to take on such when they choose to have a child. Defenders of the causal account often focus on cases in which procreation is not intentional, in order to isolate the causal role as being sufficient for the generation of parental obligations.

Advocates of the causal account set aside cases such as rape, where coercion is present. They maintain that in other important cases one can incur obligations to offspring, even if one does not intend to procreate or consent to take on such obligations. The general idea is that when a person voluntarily engages in a behavior which can produce reasonably foreseeable consequences, and the agent is a proximate and primary cause of those consequences, then it follows that the agent has obligations with respect to those consequences. In the case of procreation, the child needs care. To fail to provide it is to allow harmful consequences to obtain. Since the agent is causally responsible for the existence of a child in need of care, then the agent is morally responsible to provide it. This is similar to other situations in which an agent is causally responsible for harm or potential harm and is thereby thought to also bear moral responsibility relative to that harm. For instance, if a person damages his neighbor’s property via some action, then that person thereby incurs the moral responsibility to compensate his neighbor for that damage. By parity of reasoning, defenders of the causal account of parental obligations argue that causal responsibility for the existence of a child—when coercion is not present—entails moral responsibility with respect to preventing the child’s experiencing various kinds of suffering and harm.

The heart of the disagreement between proponents of the causal account and their critics is whether or not the voluntary acceptance of the special obligations of parenthood is necessary for incurring those obligations. Critics of the causal account argue that it is difficult to isolate parents as those who bear causal responsibility for a child’s existence, given the causal roles others play (such as medical practitioners). Given the variety of individuals that are causally connected to the existence of a particular child, the connections between causal responsibility and moral responsibility in this particular realm of life are unclear. A defense of the causal account against this objection includes the claim that the interests of children are in play here and deeply connected with the causal parents and not medical practitioners. This may be a hybrid account however, coupling causation with an interests-based account of parental obligation, which is the focus of the next section.

f. Fundamental Interests of Parents and Children

This view of parenthood focuses on fundamental interests—those which are crucial for human flourishing—as the grounds for the rights and obligations of parents. The general picture is a familiar one in which such interests generate correlative rights and obligations. In the parent-child relationship, there are several such interests in play, including psychological well-being, the forging and maintenance of intimate relationships, and the freedom to pursue that which brings satisfaction and meaning to life. The interests of children connected with their custodial parents are numerous and significant. If a child receives caring, intimate, and focused attention from a parent, this can help her to become an autonomous agent capable of pursuing and enjoying intimate relationships and psychological and emotional health. It can also contribute to her having the ability to create and pursue valuable ends in life. The lack of such attention and care often has very detrimental effects on the development and life prospects of a child. These interests are thought to generate the obligations of parenthood.

How is it that these interests are thought to generate parental rights? Parents can experience meaning and satisfaction in life via the various actions related to parenting, as they offer care, guidance, and knowledge to their children. By playing a role in satisfying the fundamental interests of their children, parents have many of their own interests satisfied, including the ones mentioned above: psychological well-being, the forging and maintenance of intimate relationships, and experiencing satisfaction with and meaning in life. It is important for interests-based accounts of parental rights to note that a condition for the satisfaction of the relevant interests often requires that the parent-child relationship be relatively free from intrusion. If the state exercises excessive control in this realm of human life, the parent becomes a mediator of the will of the state and many of the goods of parenthood then are lost. The parent is not making as significant of a personal contribution to the well-being of her child as she might otherwise be able to do, and so is not able to achieve some of the goods that more autonomous parenting makes possible, including intimacy in the parent-child relationship. There are certainly cases in which intrusion is warranted, such as instances of abuse and neglect, but in these types of cases there is no longer a genuine intimacy present to be threatened, given that abuse blocks relational intimacy. Finally, defenders of this view of parenthood conclude that if children need parental guidance and individualized attention based on an intimate knowledge of their preferences and dispositions, then the state has an interest in refraining from interfering in that relationship until overriding conditions obtain. Parents have rights, as parents, to this conditional freedom from intrusion.

3. Skepticism about Parental Rights and Obligations

a. Children’s Liberation

Advocates of children’s liberation hold that parents should have no rights over children because such paternal control is an unjustified inequality; it is both unnecessary and immoral. Those who support children’s liberation argue that children should possess the same legal and moral status as adults. This entails that children should be granted the same rights and freedoms that adults possess, such as self-determination, voting, and sexual autonomy, as well as the freedom to select guardians other than their parents. While advocates of liberationism disagree on the particular rights that children should be granted, they agree that the status quo regarding paternalism with respect to children is unjust. Clearly such a view is a challenge to the legal and moral status of parents. One argument in favor of this view focuses on the consistency problem. If rights are grounded in the possession of certain capacities, then it follows that when an individual has the relevant capacities—such as autonomy—then that individual should possess the rights in question. Consistency may require either denying certain rights to particular adults who do not possess the relevant capacities in order to preserve paternalistic control of children, or granting full human rights to particular children who possess the relevant capacities. Alternatively, it has been suggested that children should be granted all of the rights possessed by adults, even if they do not yet possess the relevant capacities (Cohen 1980). Rather than being left to themselves to exercise those rights, children could borrow the capacities they lack from others who are obligated to help them secure their rights and who possess the relevant capacities. Once children actualize these capacities, they may then act as agents on their own behalf. The upshot is that a difference in capacities does not justify denying rights to children.

Critics of children’s liberation argue that paternalistic treatment of children enables them to develop their capacities and become autonomous adults with the attendant moral and legal status. They also worry that in a society in which children are liberated in this way, many will forego education and other goods which are conducive to and sometimes necessary for their long-term welfare. It has also been suggested that limiting children’s right of self-determination fosters their development and protects them from exploitative employment. Granting equal rights to children might also prevent parents from providing the moral training children need, and cause adolescents to be even less likely to consider seriously the guidance offered by their parents. In addition, critics point out that autonomy is not the only relevant issue with respect to granting equal rights to children. The capacity for moral behavior is also important, and should be taken into account given the facts of moral development related to childhood. Finally, if a child possesses the relevant actualized capacities, then perhaps theoretical consistency requires that she be granted the same moral and legal status accorded to adults. However, the critic of children’s liberation may hold that this is simply a case where theory and practice cannot coincide due to the practical barriers in attempting to bring the two together. Perhaps the best way in which to bring theory and practice together is to emphasize the moral obligations of parents to respect the developed and developing autonomy and moral capacities of their children.

b. The Myth of Parental Rights

It has been argued that parents do not possess even a qualified or conditional moral right to impact the lives of their children in significant ways (Montague 2000). The reason that Montague rejects the notion of parental rights is that such rights lack two essential components of moral rights. First, moral rights are oriented towards their possessors. Second, moral rights have a discretionary character. Since the putative rights of parents have neither of these features, such rights should be rejected. If there were parental rights, their function would be to protect either the interests that parents have or the choices they make regarding the parent-child relationship. The problem for the proponent of parental rights is that no other right shares a particular feature of such rights, namely, that the relevant set of interests or autonomy is only worth protecting because of the value of protecting the interests or autonomy of others. Moreover, Montague argues that parental rights to care for children are in tension with parental obligations to do so. The notion of parental rights is in tension with the fact that parents are obligated to protect their children’s interests and assist them in the process of developing into autonomous individuals. Practically speaking, an emphasis on parental rights focuses on what is good for parents, while a focus on parental obligations emphasizes the well-being of children. He concludes that we have strong reasons for rejecting the notion that parents have a right to impact, in a significant way, the lives of their children. So, the view is that parental rights are incompatible with parental obligations. Parents have discretion regarding how to fulfill their obligations, but they do not have such discretion regarding whether to do so. If there were parental rights, parents would have discretion regarding whether to protect and promote the interests of their children, and this is unacceptable. In reply, one critic of Montague’s argument) has pointed out that while it is true that parents do not have discretion regarding what counts as fulfilling their obligations towards their children, they nevertheless have discretion regarding how to do so, and perhaps this is sufficient for thinking that there are some parental rights (Austin 2007).

4. Applied Parental Ethics

While the vast majority of philosophers agree that children have at least some rights—such as the right to life, for example—the extent of those rights and how they relate to the rights and obligations of parents is an issue that generates much controversy. The existence and extent of parental rights, the rights of children, and the relevant interests of the state all come together when one considers issues in applied parental ethics. The theoretical conception of rights one holds as well as one’s view of the comparative strength of those rights will often inform what one takes to be the personal, social, and public policy implications with respect to these issues.

a. Parental Licensing

Hugh LaFollette’s defense of the claim that the state should license parents is perhaps the most influential and widely discussed version of the philosophical argument in favor of parental licensing (LaFollette 1980).  LaFollette argues that (i) if an activity is potentially harmful to others; (ii) requires a certain level of competence; and (iii) this competence can be demonstrated via a reliable test, then the activity in question should be regulated by the state. These criteria justify current licensing programs. For instance, we require that physicians obtain medical licenses from the state to ensure their competency due to the potential harm caused by medical malpractice. In order to drive an automobile, a level of skill must be demonstrated because of the potential harm to others that can be done by incompetent drivers. These criteria also apply to parenting. It is clear that parents can harm their children through abuse, neglect, and lack of love, which often results in physical and psychological trauma. Children who suffer such harms may become adults who are neither well-adjusted nor happy, which can lead to cyclical patterns of abuse and other negative social consequences. Parenting also requires a certain competency that many people lack due to temperament, ignorance, lack of energy, and psychological instability. LaFollette believes that we can create a moderately reliable psychological test that will identify those individuals who will likely abuse or neglect their children. At the time of his paper, such tests were just beginning to be formulated. Since then, however, accurate parenting tests have been developed which could serve as useful tools for identifying individuals who are likely to be extremely bad parents (McFall 2009). Given that parenting is potentially harmful and requires competence that can be demonstrated via a reliable test, by parity of reasoning the state should also require licenses for parents. Moreover, given that we screen adoptive parents and require that they demonstrate a level of competence before they are allowed to adopt a child in order to reduce the chances of abuse or neglect, there is no compelling reason not to require the same of biological parents. The aim of parental licensing is not to pick out parents who will be very good, but rather to screen those who will likely be very bad by abusing or neglecting their children. The intent is to prevent serious harm to children, as well as the harms others suffer because of the social impact of child abuse. LaFollette concludes that since a state program for licensing parents is desirable, justifiable, and feasible, it follows that we should implement such a program.

Critics argue that there are both theoretical and practical problems with such proposals. Some worry about cases where a woman is pregnant before acquiring a license and fails to obtain one before giving birth. The picture of the state removing a newborn infant in such cases and transferring custody to suitable adoptive parents is problematic because no abuse or neglect has yet occurred. A variety of alternatives, including less invasive licensing as well as non-licensing alternatives, have been proposed. LaFollette himself puts forth the possibility that instead of prohibiting unlicensed parents from raising children, the state could offer tax incentives for licensed parents and other types of interventions, such as scrutiny by protective services of unlicensed parents, on the condition that such measures would provide adequate protection for children. Others have proposed different requirements for a parental license, with both fewer and greater restrictions than those proposed by LaFollette. These include minimum and maximum age requirements, mandatory parenting education, signing a contract in which a parent agrees to care for and not maltreat his or her child (so that if a child is maltreated, removal of the child would be based on a breach of contract rather than criminal liability), financial requirements, and cognitive requirements. Others argue for alternatives to licensing, such as mandatory birth control, extended (and perhaps paid) maternity and paternity leave, and universal daycare provided by the government.

Finally, some argue that legally mandated family monitoring and counseling is preferable to a program of licensing parents because it better accounts for the interests people have in becoming and being parents and the welfare of children. It is also claimed to be preferable to licensing because it avoids the possible injustices that may occur given the fallibility of any test aimed at predicting human behavior. If people who are or will soon be parents can develop as parents, it is better to give them the opportunity to do so under close supervision, monitoring, and counseling, allowing them to be with their children when they are young and a significant amount of bonding occurs. This practice would protect the interests of children, society, and parents. For those parents whose incompetence is severe or who fail to deal with their incompetence in a satisfactory manner, the monitoring/counseling proposal rightly prevents them from raising children, according to advocates of this approach.

b. The Child’s Right to an Open Future

A significant concept shaping much of the debate concerning the ethics of childrearing is that of the child’s right to an open future (Feinberg 1980). According to this argument, children have a right to have their options kept open until they become autonomous and are able to decide among those options for themselves, according to their own preferences. Parents violate the child’s right to an open future when they ensure that certain options will be closed to the child when she becomes an autonomous adult. For example, a parent who is overly directive concerning the religious views of her child, or who somehow limits the career choices of her child is violating this right. When parents violate this right, they are violating the autonomy rights of the adult that the child will become. According to Feinberg, parents are obligated to offer their children as much education as is feasible, as this will enable them to choose from a maximally broad range of potential life options upon reaching adulthood. When parents do engage in more directive parenting, they should do so in the preferred directions of the child, or at least not counter to those preferences. In this way, parents respect the preferences and autonomy of their children, allowing them to exercise their rights in making significant choices in life that are in line with their own natural preferences.

One direct criticism of Feinberg’s view includes the observation that steering one’s child toward particular options in the context of parenthood is unavoidable (Mills 2003). According to Mills, there are three options relative to the future which parents may choose from as they determine how directive they ought to be. First, as Feinberg claims, parents may provide their children with a maximally open future. Second, parents may direct their children toward a future which the parents value and endorse. Third, parents may opt for a compromise between these two options. Whether or not one considers some particular set of options to be open is connected to one’s perspective. Given this, one’s judgment concerning whether or not a particular child has an open future is also connected to that perspective. For instance, someone outside of the Amish community would likely contend that children in that community do not have an open future; by virtue of being Amish, careers in medicine, science, and technology are closed to such children. Yet from an Amish perspective, children have a variety of options including farming, blacksmithing, woodworking, etc. Rather than speaking of an option as open or closed, Mills argues that we should think of options as encouraged, discouraged, fostered, or inhibited. Practically speaking, in order to encourage a child toward or away from some option in life, other options must be closed down.  Finally, Mills criticizes Feinberg’s view on the grounds that it places more value on the future life of the child, rather than the present.

c. Medical Decision Making

Many are concerned about state intervention in medical decision making as it is performed by parents on behalf of their children. Most would agree that the interests of all relevant parties, including children, parents, and the state, must be taken into account when making medical decisions on behalf of children. The worry is that state intrusion into this arena is an improper invasion of family privacy. And yet among those who generally agree that such decisions should be left to parents, the claim is not that parents have absolute authority to make such decisions on behalf of their children. Given the weight of the interests and rights at issue, exceptions to parental autonomy are usually made at least in cases where the life of the child is at stake, on the grounds that the right to life trumps the right to privacy, when those rights come into conflict. While some parents may have religious reasons for foregoing certain kinds of medical treatment with respect to their children, it is controversial to say the least that parental rights to the exercise of religion are strong enough to trump a child’s right to life. According to some, the state, in its role of parens patriae, can legitimately intervene on behalf of children in many such cases. The courts have done so in cases where the illness or injury in question is life-threatening and yet a child’s parents refuse treatment. In less serious cases, the state has been more reluctant to intervene. However, the state’s interest in healthy children is apparently leading to a greater willingness to intervene in less drastic cases as well (Foreman and Ladd 1996).

A different set of issues arises with respect to medical decision making as it applies to procreative decisions, both those that are now available and those that for now are mere future possibilities. With respect to the former, it is now possible for parents to engage in attempted gender selection. An increasing number of couples are using reproductive technologies to select the sex of their children. One technique for making such a selection involves using the process of in vitro fertilization and then testing the embryos at three days of age for the desired sex. Those that are the preferred sex are then implanted in the womb and carried to term. Another technology which can be employed by couples who are seeking to select the sex of their children is sperm sorting.  Female-producing sperm and male-producing sperm are separated, and then the woman is artificially inseminated with the sperm of the desired sex.  This is easier and less expensive, though not as reliable, as the in vitro procedure.

Parents might have a variety of reasons for seeking to determine the gender of their offspring, related to the gender of their current children, family structure, or other preferences which relate to this. One criticism of this practice is that it transforms children into manufactured products, which we design rather than receive. That is, children become the result, at least in part, of a consumer choice which is thought by some to be problematic in this context. In addition, this practice is thought by some to place too much weight on the desires of parents related to the traits of their (future) children. Ideally, at least, parental love for children is to be unconditional, but in cases where parents choose the gender of their offspring it may be that their love is already contingent upon the child having a certain trait or traits. Finally, given the scarcity of resources in health care, some argue that we should employ those resources in other less frivolous areas of medical care. Similar worries are raised with respect to the future use of human cloning technology. The technology would likely be costly to develop and deploy. And if such a technology comes into existence, parents may be able to select beforehand a wide variety of traits, which could also undermine morally and psychologically significant aspects of the parent-child relationship, in the view of some critics.

d. Disciplining Children

There are a variety of ways in which parents discipline or punish their children. These include corporal forms of punishment, and other forms such as time-outs, loss of privileges, fines, and verbal corrections. Of these, corporal forms of punishment are the most controversial.

Critics of corporal punishment offer many reasons for thinking that it is both immoral and a misguided practice. The use of violence and aggression is taken by many to be wrong in the context of the parent-child relationship, which they believe should be characterized by intimacy and love with no place for the infliction of physical pain. It is thought that children may learn that violence, or inflicting pain, is a permissible way to attempt to control others. Some argue that reasoning with the child and other forms of verbal and moral persuasion are more effective, as are alternative forms of discipline and punishment such as verbal reprimands or time outs. Others believe that the negative effects on children of corporal punishment are often compounded or confused by other forms of maltreatment that are also present, such as parental expressions of disgust towards the child. This makes determining the effects of the punishment itself difficult. Still others think there is a place for corporal punishment, but only as a last resort.

One philosophical assessment of corporal punishment includes a limited defense of it, which is open to revision or abandonment if future findings in psychology and child development warrant this (Benatar 1998). When such punishment is harsh or frequent, it is argued that this amounts to child abuse. However, when corporal punishment is understood as the infliction of physical pain without injury, then it may be permissible.

Several arguments in favor of banning such forms of punishment have been offered, but potential problems have been raised for them by Benatar. Some critics of corporal punishment argue that it leads to abuse. But it is argued by Benatar that the relevant evidence in support of this claim is not conclusive. And while some parents who engage in corporal punishment do abuse their children, it does not follow that corporal punishment is never permissible. If this were the case, then by parity of reasoning the abuse of alcohol or automobiles by some would justify banning their use in moderate and appropriate ways by all. The abusive use of corporal punishment is wrong, but this does not mean that non-abusive forms of such punishment are wrong. Others argue that corporal punishment degrades children, but there is no proof that it actually lowers their self-regard, or at least that it does so in an unacceptable manner. Others are concerned that corporal punishment produces psychological damage, such as anxiety, depression, or lowered self-esteem. There is evidence that excessive forms of such punishment have such effects, but not when it is mild and infrequent. Other critics argue that corporal punishment teaches the wrong lesson, namely, that our problems can be solved with the use of physical violence and that it fosters violent behavior in children who receive it. Yet the evidence does not show that the use of corporal punishment has this effect when it is mild and infrequent. Finally, critics argue that corporal punishment should not be used because it is ineffective in changing the behavior of children, though defenders of the practice dispute this claim as well (Cope 2010).

Whatever one concludes about the proper forms of punishment, corporal and non-corporal, one proposed function of whatever forms of punishment end up being morally permissible in the family is the promotion of trust in filial relationships (Hoekema 1999). Trust is important in the family, because it is essential for the flourishing of the parent-child relationship. Children must trust their parents, given facts about childhood development. And ideally, as their development warrants it, parents should trust their children. The justification of punishment, in this way of thinking, has to do with children failing to live up to the trust placed in them by their parents. As such, proper forms of punishment both reflect and reinforce that trust. If children destroy or damage property, fining them for doing so can restore trust, release them from the guilt resulting from their betrayal of trust, and then reestablish that trust which is conducive to their continued development and the quality of the parent-child relationship. A form of punishment that fails to foster trust, or that fosters fear, would be morally problematic.

e. The Religious Upbringing of Children

While it is commonplace for parents to seek to impart their own religious, moral, and political beliefs and practices to their children, some philosophers are critical of this and raise objections to this form of parental influence.

Some hold that parents should remain neutral with respect to the religion of their children, and not seek to influence the religious beliefs and practices of their offspring (Irvine 2001). One reason offered in support of this claim is that when parents rear their children within their preferred religious framework, insisting that they adopt their faith, such parents are being hypocritical. This is because, at some point in the past, the ancestors of those parents rejected the religion of their own parents. For example, if parents today insist their child adopt some Protestant form of Christianity, they are being hypocritical because at some point in the past their ancestors rejected Roman Catholicism, perhaps to the dismay of their parents, and this is said to constitute a form of hypocrisy. One reply to this has been that hypocrisy is not present, if the parents (and their ancestors) convert because they genuinely believe that the religion in question is true. If this is the justification, then no hypocrisy obtains (Austin 2009).

There are other problems with parents insisting that their children adopt their religious faith, however, having to do with autonomy. Parents may limit their children’s access to certain kinds of knowledge, such as knowledge concerning sexuality, because of their religious faith. In the name of religion, some parents also restrict access to certain forms of education which limits the autonomy of children by preventing them from coming to know about various conceptions of the good life. This may also limit their options and opportunities as adults, which limits the future autonomy of such children.

One important view concerning parenting and religious faith includes the claim that justice restricts the freedom of parents with respect to inculcating belief in a comprehensive doctrine, that is, in a broad view of the good life for human beings (Clayton 2006). This not only includes religious frameworks, but secular ones as well. The primary reason for this is that the autonomy of children must be safeguarded, as they have an interest in being raised in an environment which allows them to choose from a variety of options with respect to the good life, both religious and non-religious. The view here is that children may only be reared within a comprehensive doctrine, such as Christianity, Islam, or humanism, if they are able to and in fact do give autonomous consent, or have the intellectual capacities required to conceive of the good and of the good life. If neither of these requirements obtain, then it is wrong for parents to seek to impart their beliefs to their children. Once their children can conceive of the good and the good life, or are able to give consent to believe and practice the religion or other comprehensive doctrine, then parents may seek to do so. On this view, parents may still seek to encourage the development of particular virtues, such as generosity, in their children, as this does not threaten autonomy and helps children to develop a sense of justice. Parents are obligated to help them develop such a sense, and so this type of moral instruction and encouragement is not only permissible, but in fact obligatory for them. In reply, it has been argued that there are ways for parents to bring their children up within a particular religion or other comprehensive doctrine that protect their autonomy and help children gain a deep understanding of the nature and value of such a doctrine. Perhaps a middle ground between indoctrination and the foregoing restrictive approach is possible.

f. Parental Love

It is fitting to close with what is arguably the most important parental obligation, the obligation to love one’s children. Some philosophers—Kant, for example—believe that there is not and indeed cannot be an obligation to love another person, because love is an emotion and emotions are not under our control. Since we cannot be obligated to do something which we cannot will ourselves to do, there is no duty to love. However, some contemporary philosophers have challenged this conclusion and argued that parents do have a moral obligation to love their children (Austin 2007, Boylan 2011, Liao 2006). One reason for this is that parents have the obligation to attempt to develop the capacities in their children that are needed for a flourishing life. There is ample empirical evidence that a lack of love can harm a child’s psychological, cognitive, social, and physical development. Given this, parents are obligated to seek to foster the development of the capacities for engaging in close and loving personal relationships in their children. A primary way that parents can do this is by loving their children and seeking to form such a relationship with them. There are ways in which parents can successfully bring about the emotions associated with loving children. For example, a parent can give himself reasons for having loving emotions for his children. A parent can bring about circumstances and situations in which it is likely that she will feel such emotions. In these and many other ways, the dispositions to feel parental love can be strengthened. To say that all emotions, including the emotions associated with parental love, cannot be commanded by morality because they cannot be controlled by us is too strong a claim. Finally, there are also reasons for thinking that it is not merely the responsibility of parents to love their children, but that all owe a certain kind of love to children (Boylan 2011). If this is true, then much more needs to be done to not only encourage parents to love their children in ways that will help them to flourish, but to change social structures so that they are more effective at satisfying this central interest of children.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Almond, Brenda. The Fragmenting Family. New York: Oxford University Press, 2006.
    • Criticizes arguments for the claim that the family is merely a social construct.
  • Archard, David and David Benatar, eds. Procreation and Parenthood. New York: Oxford University Press, 2010.
    • Several essays focus on the ethics of bringing a child into existence, while the others center on the grounds and form of parental rights and obligations, once a child exists.
  • Archard, David, and Colin Mcleod, eds. The Moral and Political Status of Children. New York: Oxford University Press, 2002.
  • Archard, David. Children: Rights and Childhood, 2nd edition. New York: Routledge, 2004.
    • Extensive discussion of the rights of children and their implications for parenthood and the state’s role in family life.
  • Austin, Michael W. Wise Stewards: Philosophical Foundations of Christian Parenting (Grand Rapids, MI: Kregel Academic, 2009)
    • A discussion of the parent-child relationship that combines theological and philosophical reflection in order to construct an everyday ethic of parenthood that is distinctly Christian.
  • Austin, Michael W. Conceptions of Parenthood: Ethics and the Family. Aldershot: Ashgate, 2007.
    • A comprehensive critical overview of the main philosophical accounts of the rights and obligations of parents (including an extensive defense of the causal view of parental obligations) and their practical implications.
  • Austin, Michael W. “The Failure of Biological Accounts of Parenthood.” The Journal of Value Inquiry 38 (2004): 499-510.
    • Rejects biological accounts of parental rights and obligations.
  • Bassham, Gregory, Marc Marchese, and Jack Ryan. “Work-Family Conflict: A Virtue Ethics Analysis.” Journal of Business Ethics 40 (2002): 145-154.
    • Discussion of balancing work and family responsibilities, from the perspective of virtue ethics.
  • Bayne, Tim. “Gamete Donation and Parental Responsibility.” Journal of Applied Philosophy 20 (2003): 77-87.
    • Criticizes arguments that gamete donors take their responsibilities to their offspring too lightly.
  • Benatar, David. “The Unbearable Lightness of Bringing into Being.” Journal of Applied Philosophy 16 (1999): 173-180.
    • Argues that gamete donation is almost always morally wrong.
  • Benatar, David. “Corporal Punishment.” Social Theory and Practice 24 (1998): 237-260.
    • Evaluates many of the standard arguments against corporal punishment.
  • Blustein, Jeffrey. Parents and Children: The Ethics of the Family. New York: Oxford University Press, 1982.
    • Includes a historical overview of what philosophers have had to say about the family, an account of familial obligations, and a discussion of public policy related to the family.
  • Bodin, Jean. Six Books of the Commonwealth. Translated by M. J. Tooley. New York: Barnes and Noble, 1967.
    • Contains Bodin’s statement of absolutism.
  • Boylan, Michael. “Duties to Children.” The Morality and Global Justice Reader. Michael Boylan, ed. Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 2011, pp. 385-403.
    • Argues that all people, including but not limited to parents, have duties to children related to the basic goods of human agency.
  • Brennan, Samantha, and Robert Noggle, eds. Taking Responsibility for Children. Waterloo: Wilfrid Laurier University Press, 2007.
  • Brighouse, Harry and Adam Swift. “Parents’ Rights and the Value of the Family.” Ethics 117 (2006): 80-108.
    • An argument in favor of limited and conditional parental rights, based upon the interests of parents and children.
  • Clayton, Matthew. Justice and Legitimacy in Upbringing. New York: Oxford University Press, 2006.
    • Applies particular principles of justice to childrearing.
  • Cohen, Howard. Equal Rights for Children. Totowa, NJ: Littlefield, Adams, and Co., 1980.
    • Makes a case for the claim that children should have equal rights and discusses social policy implications of this view.
  • Cope, Kristin Collins. “The Age of Discipline: The Relevance of Age to the Reasonableness of Corporal Punishment.” Law and Contemporary Problems 73 (2010): 167-188.
    • Includes a discussion of the legal issues and debates surrounding corporal punishment, as well as references to recent research on both sides of this debate concerning its efficacy and propriety.
  • Donnelly, Michael, and Murray Straus, eds. Corporal Punishment of Children in Theoretical Perspective. New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 2005.
    • A collection of essays from a variety of disciplines which address a wide range of issues concerning corporal punishment.
  • Feinberg, Joel. “The Child’s Right to an Open Future.” In Whose Child?: Children’s Rights, Parental Authority, and State Power. Edited by William Aiken and Hugh LaFollette. Totowa, NJ: Littlefield, Adams, and Co., 1980, pp. 124-153.
    • Argues that the future autonomy of children limits parental authority in important ways.
  • Feldman, Susan. “Multiple Biological Mothers: The Case for Gestation.” Journal of Social Philosophy 23 (1992): 98-104.
    • Consequentialist argument for a social policy favoring gestational mothers when conflicts over custody arise.
  • Foreman, Edwin and Rosalind Ekman Ladd. “Making Decisions—Whose Choice?” Children’s Rights Re-Visioned. Rosalind Ekman Ladd, ed. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 1996, pp. 175-183.
    • A brief introduction to the core issues concerning medical decision making and the family.
  • Gaylin, Willard and Ruth Macklin, eds. Who Speaks for the Child: The Problems of Proxy Consent. New York: Plenum Press, 1982.
    • A collection of essays addressing medical decision making in the family.
  • Hall, Barbara. “The Origin of Parental Rights.” Public Affairs Quarterly 13 (1999): 73-82.
    • Explores the connections between the concept of self-ownership, biological parenthood, and parental rights.
  • Harris, John. “Liberating Children.” The Liberation Debate: Rights at Issue. Michael Leahy and Dan Cohn-Sherbok, eds. New York: Routledge, 1996, pp. 135-146.
    • Discusses and argues for children’s liberation, including discussion of the consistency problem.
  • Haslanger, Sally. “Family, Ancestry and Self: What is the Moral Significance of Biological Ties?” Adoption & Culture 2.
    • A criticism of David Velleman’s argument that knowing our biological parents is crucial for forging a meaningful life.
  • Hoekema, David. “Trust and Punishment in the Family.” Morals, Marriage, and Parenthood. Laurence Houlgate, ed. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 1999, pp. 256-260.
    • Argues that punishment in the family should both result from and maintain trust.
  • Irvine, William B. Doing Right by Children. St. Paul, MN: Paragon House, 2001.
    • Offers a stewardship account of parenthood, contrasted with ownership approaches.
  • Kass, Leon. “The Wisdom of Repugnance.” The New Republic 216 (1997): 17-26.
    • Argues that human cloning should be banned.
  • Kolers, Avery and Tim Bayne. “’Are You My Mommy? On the Genetic Basis of Parenthood.” Journal of Applied Philosophy 18 (2001): 273-285.
    • Argues that certain genetic accounts of parental rights are flawed, while one is more promising.
  • LaFollette, Hugh. “Licensing Parents.” Philosophy and Public Affairs 9 (1980): 182-197.
    • Argues in favor of the claim that the state should require licenses for parents.
  • Liao, S. Matthew. “The Right of Children to be Loved.” The Journal of Political Philosophy 14 (2006): 420-440.
    • Defends the claim that children have a right to be loved by parents because such love is an essential condition for having a good life.
  • McFall, Michael. Licensing Parents: Family, State, and Child Maltreatment. Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2009.
    • Contains arguments related to political philosophy, the family, and parental licensing.
  • Mills, Claudia. “The Child’s Right to an Open Future?” Journal of Social Philosophy 34 (2003): 499-509.
    • Critically evaluates the claim that children have a right to an open future.
  • Millum, Joseph. “How Do We Acquire Parental Rights?” Social Theory and Practice 36 (2010): 112-132.
    • Argues for an investment theory of parental rights, grounded in the work individuals have done as parents of a particular child.
  • Millum, Joseph. “How Do We Acquire Parental Responsibilities?” Social Theory and Practice 34 (2008): 74-93.
    • Argues that parental obligations are grounded in certain acts, the meaning of which is determined by social convention.
  • Montague, Phillip. “The Myth of Parental Rights.” Social Theory and Practice 26 (2000): 47-68.
    • Rejects the existence of parental rights on the grounds that such rights lack essential components of moral rights
  • Narayan, Uma and Julia Bartkowiak, eds. Having and Raising Children. University Park, PA: The Pennsylvania State University Press, 1999.
    • A collection of essays focused on a variety of ethical, political, and social aspects of the family.
  • Narveson, Jan. The Libertarian Idea. Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 1988.
    • Contains a statement of proprietarianism.
  • Nelson, James Lindemann. “Parental Obligations and the Ethics of Surrogacy: A Causal Perspective.” Public Affairs Quarterly 5 (1991): 49-61.
    • Argues that causing children to come into existence, rather than decisions concerning reproduction, is the primary source of parental obligations.
  • Page, Edgar. “Parental Rights.” Journal of Applied Philosophy 1 (1984): 187-203.
    • Argues that biology is the basis of parental rights; advocates a version of proprietarianism without absolutism.
  • Purdy, Laura. In Their Best Interests?: The Case against Equal Rights for Children. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1992.
    • Criticizes children’s liberationism and argues that granting children equal rights is in neither their interest nor society’s.
  • Richards, Norvin. The Ethics of Parenthood. New York: Oxford University Press, 2010.
    • Contains a discussion of the significance of biological parenthood, the obligations of parents, and the nature of the relationship between adult children and their parents.
  • Rothman, Barabara Katz. Recreating Motherhood. New York: W.M. Norton and Company, 1989.
    • A feminist treatment of a wide range of issues concerning the family.
  • Scales, Stephen. “Intergenerational Justice and Care in Parenting,” Social Theory and Practice 4 (2002): 667-677.
    • Argues for a social contract view, in which the moral community has the power to determine whether a person is capable of fulfilling the parental role.
  • Schoeman, Ferdinand. “Rights of Children, Rights of Parents, and the Moral Basis of the Family.” Ethics 91 (1980): 6-19.
    • An argument for parental rights based on filial intimacy.
  • Tittle, Peg, ed. Should Parents be Licensed? Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books, 2004.
    • An anthology of essays addressing a wide range of issues as they relate to the parental licensing debate.
  • Turner, Susan. Something to Cry About: An Argument Against Corporal Punishment of Children in Canada. Waterloo: Wilfrid Laurier University Press, 2002.
  • Velleman, J. David. “Family History.” Philosophical Papers 34 (2005): 357-378.
    • Argues that biological family ties are crucial with respect to the quest for a meaningful life.
  • Vopat, Mark. “Justice, Religion and the Education of Children.” Public Affairs Quarterly 23 (2009): 223-226.
  • Vopat, Mark. “Parent Licensing and the Protection of Children.” Taking Responsibility for Children. Samantha Brennan and Robert Noggle, eds. Waterloo: Wilfrid Laurier University Press, 2007, pp. 73-96.
  • Vopat, Mark. “Contractarianism and Children.” Public Affairs Quarterly 17 (2003): 49-63.
    • Argues that parental obligations are grounded in a social contract between parents and the state.
  • Willems, Jan C.M., ed. Developmental and Autonomy Rights of Children. Antwerp: Intersentia, 2007.


Author Information

Michael W. Austin
Eastern Kentucky University
U. S. A.

Distributive Justice

Theories of distributive justice seek to specify what is meant by a just distribution of goods among members of society. All liberal theories (in the sense specified below) may be seen as expressions of laissez-faire with compensations for factors that they consider to be morally arbitrary. More specifically, such theories may be interpreted as specifying that the outcome of individuals acting independently, without the intervention of any central authority, is just, provided that those who fare ill (for reasons that the theories deem to be arbitrary, for example, because they have fewer talents than others) receive compensation from those who fare well.

Liberal theories of justice consider the process, or outcome, of individuals’ free actions to be just except insofar as this depends on factors, in the form of personal characteristics, which are considered to be morally arbitrary. In the present context these factors may be individuals’ preferences, their abilities, and their holdings of land. Such theories may, then, be categorized according to which of these factors each theory deems to be morally arbitrary.

There is a certain tension between the libertarian and egalitarian theories of justice. Special attention below is given to the views of Dworkin, Rawls, Nozick, and Sen.

Table of Contents

  1. A Taxonomy
    1. A Simple World
    2. Liberalism
  2. Justice as Fairness
    1. Two Principles
    2. A Social Contract
    3. The Difference Principle
    4. Choice Behind the Veil
    5. Summary
  3. Equality of Resources
    1. Initial Resources
    2. Fortune
    3. Handicaps
    4. Talents
    5. Summary
  4. Entitlements
    1. The Basic Schema
    2. Patterns
    3. Justice in Acquisition
    4. Justice in Transfer
    5. Justice in Rectification
    6. Summary
  5. Common Ownership
    1. A Framework
    2. The Transfer of Property
    3. The Holding of Property
    4. The Social Fund
    5. Summary
  6. Conclusions
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. References
    2. Further Reading

1. A Taxonomy

a. A Simple World

We begin with a simple hypothetical world in which there are a number of individuals and three commodities: a natural resource, called land; a consumption good, called food; and individuals’ labour. There is a given amount of land, which is held by individuals, but no stock of food: food may be created from land and labour. An individual is characterized by his preferences between food and leisure (leisure being the obverse of labour); by his ability, or productivity in transforming land and labour into food; and by his holding of land.

Liberal theories of justice consider the process, or outcome, of individuals’ free actions to be just except insofar as this depends on factors, in the form of personal characteristics, which are considered to be morally arbitrary. In the present context these factors may be individuals’ preferences, their abilities, and their holdings of land. Such theories may, then, be categorized according to which of these factors each theory deems to be morally arbitrary.

Equality has various interpretations in this simple world: these correspond to the theories discussed below. Liberty has two aspects: self-ownership, that is, rights to one’s body, one’s labour, and the fruits thereof; and resource-ownership, that is, rights to own external resources and the produce of these. Theories that fail to maintain self-ownership may be divided into those that recognize personal responsibility in that the extent of the incursions that they make are independent of how people exercise these (for example, in being industrious or lazy), and those that do not.

In a liberal context there is (as is justified below) no basis for comparing one individual’s wellbeing with another’s, so that theories of justice which require such comparisons cannot be accommodated. Accordingly, the theories of utilitarianism, which defines a distribution to be just if it maximizes the sum of each individual’s wellbeing, and of equality of welfare, which defines a distribution to be just if each individual has the same level of wellbeing, are not considered.

Four theories of justice are discussed: Rawlsian egalitarianism, or justice as fairness; Dworkinian egalitarianism, or equality of resources; Steiner-Vallentyne libertarianism, or common ownership; and Nozickian libertarianism, or entitlements. The following specification of the theories sets out, for each theory: its definition of justice; the personal characteristics that it considers to be arbitrary and therefore makes adjustments for; the nature of the institution under which this may be achieved; the justification of any inequalities which it accepts; and the extent to which it is consistent with liberty.

Justice as fairness defines a distribution to be just if it maximizes the food that the individual with the least food receives (this is the “maximin” outcome in terms of food, which is the sole primary good). It adjusts for preferences, ability, and land holdings. It is achieved by taxes and subsidies on income (that is, on the consumption of food). Inequalities in income, subject to the maximin requirement, are accepted because of the benefit they bring to the individual with the least income; all inequalities in leisure are accepted. Rights to neither self-ownership nor resource-ownership are maintained, and responsibility is not recognized.

Equality of resources defines a distribution to be just if everyone has the same effective resources, that is, if for some given amount of work each person could obtain the same amount of food. It adjusts for ability and land holdings, but not for preferences. It is achieved by taxes and subsidies on income. Inequalities in both food and leisure are accepted because they arise solely from choices made by individuals who have the same options. Rights to neither self-ownership nor resource-ownership are maintained, but responsibility is recognized.

Common ownership theories define a distribution to be just if each person initially has the same amount of land and all transactions between individuals are voluntary. It adjusts for land holdings, but not for preferences or abilities. It is achieved by a reallocation of holdings of land. Inequalities in both food and leisure are accepted because these arise solely from people having different preferences or abilities. Rights to self-ownership are maintained but rights to resource-ownership are not.

An entitlements theory defines a distribution to be just if the distribution of land is historically justified, that is if it arose from the appropriation by individuals of previously unowned land and voluntary transfers between individuals, and all other transactions between individuals are voluntary. It makes no adjustments (other than corrections for any improper acquisitions or transfers) and thus requires no imposed institution to achieve it. All inequalities are accepted. Rights to both self-ownership and resource-ownership are maintained.

As is apparent, the first two theories emphasize outcomes while the second two emphasize institutions. These four theories form a hierarchy, or decreasing progression, in terms of the personal characteristics that they consider to be morally arbitrary, and thus for which adjustments are made. The first theory adjusts for preferences, ability, and land holdings; the second only for ability and land holdings; the third only for land holdings; and the fourth for none of these (other than the corrections noted above). The four theories form a corresponding hierarchy, or increasing progression, in terms of the liberties (self-ownership, with or without personal responsibility, and resource-ownership) that they maintain: the first maintains neither, and does not recognize responsibility; the second maintains neither, but does recognize responsibility; the third maintains self-ownership but not resource-ownership; and the fourth maintains both self-ownership and resource-ownership.

These corresponding hierarchies are illustrated schematically in the table below (from Allingham, 2014, 4).


Arbitrary factors

Liberties maintained


Preferences - Ability - Land



Ability - Land




Responsibility - Self-ownership



Responsibility - Self-ownership - Resource-ownership


The remainder of this survey develops these theories of justice. It demonstrates that they also form a third hierarchy in terms of equality (of outcome), with Rawls’s justice as fairness as the most egalitarian, followed by Dworkin’s equality of resources, then common ownership in the Steiner-Vallentyne vein, and finally Nozick’s entitlements theory as the least egalitarian. The order in which these theories are discussed differs from that of the decreasing progression in terms of what they consider to be arbitrary: specifically, the discussion of entitlements precedes that of common ownership. The reason for this is that common ownership theories follow temporally, and draw on, Nozick’s entitlements theory.

b. Liberalism 

The theories of justice considered are liberal in that they do not presuppose any particular conception of the good. They subscribe to what Sandel calls deontological liberalism: “society, being composed of a plurality of persons, each with his own aims, interests, and conceptions of the good, is best arranged when it is governed by principles that do not themselves presuppose any particular conception of the good” (1998, 1).

The importance of deontological liberalism is that it precludes any interpersonal comparisons of utility. As Scanlon (who supports interpersonal comparisons) accepts, “interpersonal comparisons present a problem insofar as it is assumed that the judgements of relative well-being on which social policy decisions, or claims of justice, are based should not reflect value judgements” (1991, 17). And Hammond, who also supports interpersonal comparisons, accepts that such comparisons “really do require that an individual’s utility be the ethical utility or worth of that individual to the society” (191, 237). If we are not prepared to take a position on someone’s worth to society then we cannot engage in interpersonal utility comparisons. It is in the light of this that Arrow notes that “it requires a definite value judgement not derivable from individual sensations to make the utilities of different individuals dimensionally compatible and a still further value judgement to aggregate them”, and accordingly concludes that “interpersonal comparison of utilities has no meaning and, in fact, … there is no meaning relevant to welfare comparisons in the measurability of individual utility” (2012, 9-11).

2. Justice as Fairness

Justice as fairness, as developed by Rawls, treats all personal attributes as being morally arbitrary, and thus defines justice as requiring equality, unless any departure from this benefits everyone. This view is summarized in Rawls’s “general conception of justice”, which is that “all social values - liberty and opportunity, income and wealth, and the social bases of self-respect - are to be distributed equally unless an unequal distribution of any, or all, of these values is to everyone’s advantage”: injustice “is simply inequalities that are not to the benefit of all” (1999, 24).

a. Two Principles

Rawls’s interpretation is made more precise in his two principles of justice. He proposes various formulations of these; the final formulation is that of Political Liberalism:

a. Each person has an equal claim to a fully adequate scheme of equal basic rights and liberties, which scheme is compatible with the same scheme for all; and in this scheme the equal political liberties, and only those liberties, are to be guaranteed their fair value.

b. Social and economic inequalities are to satisfy two conditions: first, they are to be attached to positions and offices open to all under conditions of fair equality of opportunity; and second, they are to be to the greatest benefit of the least advantaged members of society (2005, 5-6).

These principles are lexically ordered: the first principle has priority over the second; and in the second principle the first part has priority over the second part. For the specific question of distributive justice, as opposed to the wider question of political justice, it is the final stone in the edifice that is crucial: this is the famous difference principle.

b. A Social Contract

Rawls justifies his two principles of justice by a social contract argument. For Rawls, a just state of affairs is a state on which people would agree in an original state of nature. Rawls seeks “to generalize and carry to a higher order of abstraction the traditional theory of the social contract as represented by Locke, Rousseau, and Kant”, and to do so in a way “that it is no longer open to the more obvious objections often thought fatal to it” (1999, xviii).

Rawls sees the social contract as being neither historical nor hypothetical but a thought-experiment for exploring the implications of an assumption of moral equality as embodied in the original position. To give effect to this Rawls assumes that the parties to the contract are situated behind a veil of ignorance where they do not know anything about themselves or their situations, and accordingly are equal. The intention is that as the parties to the contract have no information about themselves they necessarily act impartially, and thus as justice as fairness requires. As no one knows his circumstances, no one can try to impose principles of justice that favour his particular condition.

c. The Difference Principle

Rawls argues that in the social contract formed behind a veil of ignorance the contractors will adopt his two principles of justice, and in particular the difference principle: that all inequalities “are to be to the greatest benefit of the least advantaged members of society”. This requires the identification of the least advantaged. There are thee aspects to this: what constitutes the members of society; what counts as being advantaged; and how the advantages of one member are to be compared with those of another.

It would seem natural in defining the least advantaged members of society to identify the least advantaged individuals, but Rawls does not do this. Instead, he seeks to identify representatives of the least advantaged group.

The wellbeing of representatives is assessed by their allocation of what Rawls terms primary goods. There are two classes of primary goods. The first class comprises social primary goods, such as liberty (the subject matter of the first part of the second principle of justice) and wealth (the subject matter of the second part of that principle). The second class comprises natural primary goods, such as personal characteristics. Justice as fairness is concerned with the distribution of social primary goods; and of these the difference principle is concerned with those that are the subject matter of the second part of the second principle of justice, such as wealth.

Rawls’s primary goods are “things which it is supposed a rational man wants whatever else he wants”: regardless of what precise things someone might want “it is assumed that there are various things which he would prefer more of rather than less”. More specifically, “primary social goods, to give them in broad categories, are rights, liberties, and opportunities, and income and wealth”. These fall into two classes: the first comprise rights, liberties, and opportunities; and the second, which is the concern of the difference principle, income and wealth. The essential difference between these classes is that “liberties and opportunities are defined by the rules of major institutions and the distribution of income and wealth is regulated by them” (1999, 79).

The construction of an index of primary social goods poses a problem, for income and wealth comprise a number of disparate things and these cannot immediately be aggregated into a composite index. Rawls proposes to construct such an index “by taking up the standpoint of the representative individual from this group and asking which combination of primary social goods it would be rational for him to prefer”, even though “in doing this we admittedly rely upon intuitive estimates” (1999, 80).

d. Choice Behind the Veil

Each contractor considers all feasible distributions of primary goods and chooses one. Because the contractors have been stripped of all distinguishing characteristics they all make the same choice, so there is in effect only one contractor. The distributions that this contractor considers allocate different amounts of primary goods to different positions, not to named persons.

The contractor does not know which position he will occupy, and as he is aware that he may occupy the least advantaged position he chooses the distribution that allocates the highest index of primary goods to that position. That is, he chooses the distribution that maximizes the index of the least advantaged, or minimum, position. Rawls thus considers his “two principles as the maximin solution to the problem of social justice” since “the maximin rule tells us to rank alternatives by their worst possible outcomes: we are to adopt the alternative the worst outcome of which is superior to the worst outcomes of the others” (1999, 132-133).

A major problem with Rawls’s theory of justice is that rational contractors will not, except in a most extreme case, choose the maximin outcome. Despite Rawls claiming that “extreme attitudes to risk are not postulated” (1999, 73) it appears that they are, and thus to choose the maximin distribution is to display the most extreme aversion to risk. In global terms, it is to prefer the distribution of world income in which 7 billion people have just $1 above a widely accepted subsistence income level of $365 a year to the distribution in which all of these except one (who has $365 a year) have the income of the average Luxembourger with $80,000 a year. It is to choose a world of universal abject poverty over one of comfortable affluence for all but one person. As Roemer expresses it, “the choice, by such a [representative] soul, of a Rawlsian tax scheme is hardly justified by rationality, for there seems no good reason to endow the soul with preferences that are, essentially, infinitely risk averse” (1996, 181).

Rawls appreciates that “there is a relation between the two principles and the maximin rule for choice under uncertainty”, and accepts that “clearly the maximin rule is not, in general, a suitable guide for choices under uncertainty”. However, he claims that it is a suitable guide if certain features obtain, and seeks to show that “the original position has these features to a very high degree”. He identifies three such features. The first is that “since the rule takes no account of the likelihoods of the possible circumstances, there must be some reason for sharply discounting estimates of these probabilities”. The second is that “the person choosing has a conception of the good such that he cares very little, if anything, for what he might gain above the minimum stipend that he can, in fact, be sure of by following the maximin rule”. The third is that “the rejected alternatives have outcomes that one can hardly accept” (1999, 132-134). However, none of these three features appears to justify the choice by a rational contractor of the maximin distribution. Accordingly, Roemer concludes that “the Rawlsian system is inconsistent and cannot be coherently reconstructed” (1996, 182).

e. Summary

The strength of Rawls’s theory of justice as fairness lies in its combination of the fundamental notion of equality with the requirement that everyone be better off than they would be under pure equality. However, the theory has a number of problems. Some of these may be avoided by inessential changes, but other problems are unavoidable, particularly that of identifying the least advantaged (with the related problems of defining primary goods and the construction of an index of these), and that of the supposedly rational choice of the maximin principle with, as Harsanyi puts it, its “absurd practical implications” (1977, 47 as reprinted).

3. Equality of Resources

Equality of resources, as developed by Dworkin, treats individuals’ abilities and external resources as arbitrary, but makes no adjustments for their preferences. The essence of this approach is the distinction between ambition-sensitivity, which recognizes differences which are due to differing ambitions, and endowment-sensitivity, which recognizes differences that are due to differing endowments.

a. Initial Resources

Dworkin accepts that inequalities are acceptable if they result from voluntary choices, but not if they result from disadvantages that have not been chosen. However, initial equality of resources is not sufficient for justice. Even if everyone starts from the same position one person may fare better than another because of her good luck, or, alternatively, because of her lesser handicaps or greater talents.

Dworkin motivates his theory of justice with the example of a number of survivors of a shipwreck who are washed up, with no belongings, on an uninhabited island with abundant natural resources. The survivors accept that these resources should be allocated among them in some equitable fashion, and agree that for a division to be equitable it must meet “the envy test”, which requires that no one “would prefer someone else’s bundle of resources to his own bundle” (1981, 285). The envy test, however, is too weak a test: Dworkin gives examples of allocations that meet this test but appear inequitable. Can you give an illustration here

To deal with such cases Dworkin proposes that the survivors appoint an auctioneer who gives each of them an equal number of tokens. The auctioneer divides the resources into a number of lots and proposes a system of prices, one for each lot, denominated in tokens. The survivors bid for the lots, with the requirement that their total proposed expenditure in tokens not exceed their endowment of tokens. If all markets clear, that is, if there is precisely one would-be purchaser for each lot, then the process ends. If all markets do not clear then the auctioneer adjusts the prices, and continues to adjust them until they do.

b. Fortune

Dworkin seeks to make people responsible for the effects of their choices, but not for matters beyond their control. To take account of the latter, he distinguishes between “option luck” and “brute luck”. Option luck is “a matter of how deliberate and calculated gambles turn out”. Brute luck is “a matter of how risks fall out that are not in that sense deliberate gambles” (1981, 293). People should be responsible for the outcomes of option luck, but not of brute luck.

Dworkin’s key argument concerning luck is that “insurance, so far as it is available, provides a link between brute and option luck, because the decision to buy or reject catastrophe insurance is a calculated gamble”. Then because people should be responsible for the outcomes of option luck they should be responsible for the outcomes of all luck, at least if they could have bought insurance. Accordingly, Dworkin amends his envy test by requiring that “any resources gained through a successful gamble should be represented by the opportunity to take the gamble at the odds in force, and comparable adjustments made to the resources of those who have lost through gambles” (1981, 293-295).

c. Handicaps

Insurance cannot remove all risks: if someone is born blind he cannot buy insurance against blindness. Dworkin seeks to take account of this through a hypothetical insurance scheme. He asks how much an average person would be prepared to pay for insurance against being handicapped if in the initial state everyone had the same, and known, chance of being handicapped. He then supposes that “the average person would have purchased insurance at that level” (1981, 298), and proposes to compensate those who do develop handicaps out of a fund that is collected by taxation but designed to match the fund that would have been provided through insurance premiums. The compensation that someone with a handicap is to receive is the contingent compensation that he would have purchased, knowing the risk of being handicapped, had actual insurance been available.

Accordingly, the auction procedure is amended so that the survivors “now establish a hypothetical insurance market which they effectuate through compulsory insurance at a fixed premium for everyone based on speculations about what the average immigrant… would have purchased by way of insurance had the antecedent risk of various handicaps been equal” (1981, 301).

This process establishes equality of effective resources at the outset, but this equality will typically be disturbed by subsequent economic activity. If some survivors choose to work more than others they will produce, and thus have, more than their more leisurely compatriots. Thus at some stage the envy test will not be met. This, however, does not create a problem because the envy test is to be applied diachronically: “it requires that no one envy the bundle of occupation and resources at the disposal of anyone else over time, though someone may envy another’s bundle at any particular time” (1981, 306). Since everyone had the opportunity to work hard it would violate rather than endorse equality of resources if the wealth of the hardworking were from time to time to be distributed to the more leisurely.

d. Talents

The essential reason why differential talents create a problem is that equality of resources at the outset will typically be disturbed, not because of morally acceptable differences in work habits, but because of morally arbitrary differences in talents.

Requiring equality of resources only at the outset would be what Dworkin calls a starting-gate theory of fairness, which Dworkin sees as being “very far from equality of resources” and strongly rejects: “indeed it is hardly a coherent political theory at all”. Such a theory holds that justice requires equality of initial resources, but accepts laissez-faire thereafter. The fundamental problem with a starting-gate theory is that it relies on some purely arbitrary starting point. If the requirement of equality of resources is to apply at one arbitrary point, then presumably it is to apply at other points. If justice requires a Dworkinian auction when the survivors arrive, then it must require such an auction from time to time thereafter; and if justice accepts laissez-faire thereafter, it must accept it when they arrive. Dworkin requires neither that there be periodic auctions nor that there be laissez-faire at all times. His theory does not suppose that an equal division of resources is appropriate at one point in time but not at any other; it argues only that the resources available to someone at any moment be a function of the resources available to or consumed by him at others.

Dworkin’s aim is to specify a scheme that allows the distribution of resources at any point of time to be both ambition-sensitive, in that it reflects the cost or benefit to others of the choices people make, but not be endowment-sensitive, in that it allows scope for differences in ability among people with the same ambitions. To achieve this, Dworkin proposes a hypothetical insurance scheme that is analogous to that for handicaps. In this scheme it is supposed that people know what talents they have, but not the income that these will produce, and choose a level of insurance accordingly. An imaginary agency knows each person’s talents and preferences, and also knows what resources are available and the technology for transforming these into other resources. On the basis of this it computes the income structure, that is, the number of people earning each level of income that will emerge in a competitive market. Each person may buy insurance from the agency to cover the possibility of his income falling below whatever level he cares to name. Dworkin asks “how much of such insurance would the survivors, on average, buy, at what specified level of income coverage, and at what cost?” (1981, 317) and claims that the agency can answer this question.

This, however, is not clear. Consider four very weak requirements of such a scheme: it should distribute resources in such a way that not everyone could be better off under any alternative scheme; an increase in the resources available for allocation should not make anyone worse off; if two people have the same preferences and abilities then they should be allocated the same resources; and the scheme should not damage those whom it seeks to help. As is shown by Roemer, there is in Dworkin’s framework no scheme that satisfies these requirements, so that “resource egalitarianism is an incoherent notion” (1985, 178).

e. Summary

The strength of Dworkin’s equality of resources theory of justice is that it seeks to introduce ambition-sensitivity without allowing endowment-sensitivity. To the extent to which it succeeds in this it thus, in Cohen’s words, incorporates within egalitarianism “the most powerful idea in the arsenal of the anti-egalitarian right: the idea of choice and responsibility” (1989, 933).

However, it is not entirely successful in this endeavour. There are a number of problems with Dworkin’s auction scheme: for example, it is not clear that the auctioneer will ever discover prices at which there is precisely one would-be purchaser for each lot. However, these may be avoided by adopting the intended outcome of the auction, that is, as a free-market outcome in which everyone has the same wealth, as a specification of justice in its own right. But the problems with the insurance scheme are deeper, as Roemer’s argument (presented above) demonstrates.

4. Entitlements

Nozick’s entitlements theory (as an extreme) treats no personal attributes as being arbitrary, and thus defines justice simply as laissez-faire, provided that no one’s rights are infringed. In this view “the complete principle of distributive justice would say simply that a distribution is just if everyone is entitled to the holdings they possess under the distribution” (1974, 151).

a. The Basic Schema

Nozick introduces his approach to “distributive justice” by noting that the term is not a neutral one, but presupposes some central authority that is effecting the distribution. But that is misleading, for there is no such body. Someone’s property holdings are not allocated to her by some central planner: they arise from the sweat of her brow or through voluntary exchanges with, or gifts from, others. There is “no more a distributing or distribution of shares than there is a distributing of mates in a society in which persons choose whom they shall marry” (1974, 150).

Accordingly, Nozick holds that the justice of a state of affairs is a matter of whether individuals are entitled to their holdings. In Nozick’s schema, individuals’ entitlements are determined by two principles, justice in acquisition and justice in transfer:

If the world were wholly just, the following inductive definition would exhaustively cover the subject of justice in holdings.

1. A person who acquires a holding in accordance with the principle of justice in acquisition is entitled to that holding.

2. A person who acquires a holding in accordance with the principle of justice in transfer, from someone else entitled to the holding, is entitled to the holding.

3. No one is entitled to a holding except by (repeated) applications of 1 and 2. (1974, 151)

However, the world may not be wholly just: as Nozick observes, “not all actual situations are generated in accordance with the two principles of justice in holdings”. The existence of past injustice “raises the third major topic under justice in holdings: the rectification of injustice in holdings” (1974, 152).

b. Patterns

Nozick distinguishes entitlement principles of justice from patterned principles. A principle is patterned if “it specifies that a distribution is to vary along with some natural dimension, weighted sum of natural dimensions, or lexicographic ordering of natural dimensions”. A distribution that is determined by peoples’ ages or skin colours, or by their needs or merits, or by any combination of these, is patterned. Nozick claims that “almost every suggested principle of distributive justice is patterned” (1974, 156), where by “almost” he means “other than entitlement principles”.

The fundamental problem with patterned principles is that liberty upsets patterns. As Hume expresses it, “render possessions ever so equal, men’s different degrees of art, care, and industry will immediately break that equality” (1751, 3.2). Nozick argues this using his famous Wilt Chamberlain example.

Suppose that a distribution that is (uniquely) specified as just by some patterned principle of distributive justice is realized: this may be one in which everyone has an equal share of wealth, or where shares vary in any other patterned way. Now there is a basketball player, one Wilt Chamberlain, who is of average wealth but of superior ability. He enters into a contract with his employers under which he will receive 25 cents for each admission ticket sold to see him play. As he is so able a player a million people come to watch him. Accordingly, Mr Chamberlain earns a further $250,000. The question is, is this new distribution, in which Mr Chamberlain is much better off than in the original distribution, and also much better off than the average person, just? One answer must be that it is not, for the new distribution differs from the old, and by hypothesis the old distribution (and only that distribution) was just. On the other hand, the original distribution was just, and people moved from that to the new distribution entirely voluntarily. Mr Chamberlain and his employers voluntarily entered into the contract; all those who chose to buy a ticket to watch Mr Chamberlain play did so voluntarily; and no one else was affected. All holdings under the original distribution were, by hypothesis, just, and people have used them to their advantage: if people were not entitled to use their holdings to their advantage (subject to not harming others) it is not clear why the original distribution would have allocated them any holdings. If the original distribution was just and people voluntarily moved from it to the new distribution then the new distribution must be just.

c. Justice in Acquisition

Acquisition of material is considered to be just if what is acquired is freely available and if acquiring it leaves sufficient material for others. Giving an operational meaning to this requires the specification of what acquisition means, what is freely available, and how leaving sufficient material for others is to be interpreted. In these, Nozick, albeit with reservations, follows Locke.

Locke interprets “acquiring” as “mixing one’s labour with” (1689, 2.5.27). I own my labour, and if I inextricably mix my labour with something that no one else owns then I make that thing my own. However, as Nozick points out (without proposing any resolution of these) there are a number of problems with this interpretation. It is not clear why mixing something that I own with something that I do not own implies that I gain the latter rather than lose the former. In Nozick’s example, “if I own a can of tomato juice and spill it in the sea … do I thereby come to own the sea, or have I foolishly dissipated my tomato juice?” Further, it is not clear what determines how much of the unowned resource I come to own. If I build a fence around a previously unowned plot of land do I own all that I have enclosed, or simply the land under the fence? In Nozick’s example, “if a private astronaut clears a place on Mars, has he mixed his labor with (so that he comes to own) the whole planet, the whole uninhabited universe, or just a particular plot?” (1974, 174-175).

Locke interprets “freely available” as being “in the state that nature hath provided”, and Nozick (without any argument) follows Locke in equating “freely available” with “unowned”. There are however, other possibilities. Virgin resources may be seen as being owned in common, or as being jointly owned in equal shares.

Locke interprets leaving sufficient for others as there being “enough, and as good, left in common for others” (1689, 2.5.27); this is the famous Lockean proviso. There are two possible interpretations of this: I may be made worse off by your appropriating a particular plot of land by no longer being able to appropriate it myself, or by no longer being able to use it. Nozick adopts the second, weaker, version.

d. Justice in Transfer

The essence of Nozick’s principle of justice in transfer is that a transfer is just if it is voluntary, in that each party consents to it. Justice in transfer also involves the satisfaction of the Lockean proviso. This is both indirect and direct. It is indirect in that I cannot legitimately transfer to you something that has been acquired, by me or by anyone else, in violation of the proviso, for that thing is not rightfully mine to transfer. But the proviso is also direct, in that I may not by a series of transfers, each of which is legitimate on its own, acquire property that does not leave enough, and as good, for others.

e. Justice in Rectification

Nozick’s basic schema applies to a world that is “wholly just”. However, the world may not be wholly just: people may have violated the principle of justice in acquisition, for example, by appropriating so much of a thing that an insufficient amount is left for others; or they may have violated the principle of justice in transfer, for example, by theft or fraud. Then, as Nozick observes, “the existence of past injustice (previous violations of the first two principles of justice in holdings) raises the third major topic under justice in holdings: the rectification of injustice in holdings”. Nozick identifies a number of questions that this raises: if past injustice has shaped present holdings in ways that are not identifiable, what should be done; how should violators compensate the victims; how does the position change if compensation is delayed; how, if at all, does the position change if the violators or the victims are no longer living; is an injustice done to someone whose holding which was itself based upon an injustice is appropriated; do acts of injustice lose their force over time; and what may the victims of injustice themselves do to rectify matters? However, these questions are not answered: as Nozick admits, “I do not know of a thorough or theoretically sophisticated treatment of such issues” (1974, 152).

f. Summary

The strength of Nozick’s entitlements theory of justice is that it uncompromisingly respects individual liberty, and thus avoids all the problems associated with patterned approaches to justice. However, by avoiding patterns it introduces its own problems, for in asking how distributions came about, rather than in simply assessing them as they are, Nozick necessarily delves into the mists of time. Here lie the two most significant, and related, problems with Nozick’s theory: that of the relatively unsatisfactory nature of the principle of justice in initial acquisition, and that of the predominantly unexplained means of rectifying any injustice resulting from that.

5. Common Ownership

Common ownership theories in the Steiner-Vallentyne vein treat individuals’ holdings of external resources as arbitrary, but (at least directly) make no adjustments for their preferences or abilities. Such theories are diverse, but they all have in common the basic premise that individuals are full owners of themselves but external resources are owned by society in common. The theories differ in what they consider to be external resources, and in what is entailed by ownership in common.

a. A Framework

Common ownership theories, as entitlement theories, emphasize institutions, or processes, rather than outcomes. In essence, they consider an institution to be just if, firstly, it recognizes the principle of self-ownership and a further principle of liberty which may be called free association, and secondly, it involves some scheme of intervention on the holding or transmission of external resources that results, if not in common ownership itself, in a distribution of resources that shares some of the aspects of common ownership.

The principle of self-ownership, as Cohen’s expresses it, is that “each person enjoys, over herself and her powers, full and exclusive rights of control and use, and therefore owes no service or product to anyone else that she has not contracted to supply” (1995, 12). I have full ownership of myself if I have all the legal rights that someone has over a slave. Since a slaveholder has the legal rights to the labour of his slave and the fruits of that labour, each person is the morally rightful owner of his labour and of the fruits thereof.

The motivation for introducing a principle of free association is that what is legitimate for you and for me should be legitimate for us, subject to the satisfaction of the Lockean proviso (if relevant). Allingham proposes the principle that “each person has a moral right to combine any property to which he is entitled with the (entitled) property of other consenting persons (and share in the benefits from such combination in any manner to which each person agrees) provided that this does not affect any third parties” (2014, 110).

Schemes of intervention on the holding or transmission of property may take the form of absolute restrictions or of taxes on the holding or transfer of property.

b. The Transfer of Property

It might be thought that my rights to my property are empty if they do not permit me to do what I will with it (provided that this does not affect others), and in particular to give it to you. On the other hand, the passing down of wealth through the generations is one of the less intuitively appealing implications of this right. There are three ways of reconciling these two positions: restrictions or taxes on all gifts, on bequests, and on re-gifting.

The first proposal is based on Vallentyne’s claim that the right to transfer property to others does not guarantee that others have an unencumbered right to receive that property, and that, accordingly, the receipt of gifts may legitimately be subject to taxation. This would be to say that (the donor) having control rights in the property, and in particular the right to give it to someone, does not imply (the donee) having income rights in the property, and in particular the unencumbered right to enjoy it.

The motivation underlying the second proposal is, in Steiner’s words, “that an individual’s deserts should be determined by reference to his ancestor’s delinquencies is a proposition which doubtless enjoys a degree of biblical authority, but its grounding in any entitlement conception of justice seems less obvious” (1977, 152). Steiner’s argument in support of this position is that, contrary to Nozick’s view, bequests are fundamentally different to gifts inter vivos. Put simply, dead people do not exist, so cannot make gifts. Accordingly, the recipients of all bequests are to be taxed.

A third proposal is that people have rights to make and receive gifts, but not that these rights last for ever. More precisely, Allingham proposes that a scheme that “adopts the position that each person has a moral right to make any gifts (inter vivos or by bequest) to any other person (which person has a moral right to receive such gifts), but that any gifts that are deemed to be re-gifted may be subject to taxation” (2014, 120). If the gifts a person makes are less than those he receives then the former are deemed to be re-gifted; if the gifts he makes are greater than those he receives then the latter are deemed to be re-gifted. Thus I may freely give to you anything that I have created or earned but not consumed, but if I pass on anything that I myself have been given then this may be taxed.

c. The Holding of Property

Interventions on the holding of property may be seen as falling into three classes. One seeks to impose taxes on land by virtue of the fact that it is God-given, one on all natural resources by virtue of the fact that they are natural, and one on all property by virtue of the fact that it is property.

The claim that land, by natural right, belongs to all, like the claim that a person belongs to himself, is made by Locke: “God … hath given the world to men in common” (1689, 2.5.26). The claim is developed by a number of the nineteenth-century writers, and is most notably associated with George. As any improvements are not due to God it is only unimproved land, not developed land, which is relevant. In a typical contribution scheme proposed by Steiner, each “owner owes to the global fund a sum equal to the site’s rental value, that is, equal to the rental value of the site alone, exclusive of the value of any alterations in it wrought by labour” (1994, 272-273).

Land is not the only natural resource: what other property is to count is not clear. As Steiner notes, in any intervention scheme involving natural resources everything “turns on the isolation of what counts as ‘natural’” (1994, 277). There are many candidates. These, as summarized by Fried, include “gifts and bequests from the preceding generation; all traditional public goods (laws, police force, public works); the community’s physical productive capacity; and well-functioning markets” (2004, 85-86). Under these schemes all natural resources would be taxed in the same way as is land.

There are three possible justifications for taxing property per se: extending the concept of bequests; removing one of the incidents of ownership; and requiring a fee for protection. The first is based on a deemed lack of personal continuity over time: that “I tomorrow” am not the same person as “I today”. If this position is adopted then “I am holding property overnight” really means “I today” am bequeathing property to “I tomorrow”; the property is a bequest not a gift inter vivos as “I today” cease to exist at midnight. The second involves limiting the rights of ownership in external objects, that is, acknowledging only less than full ownership, specifically by excluding the incident of the absence of term, that one’s rights to property do not expire. If the incident of the absence of term is excluded then I have no unencumbered right to continue my ownership in some property from today until tomorrow. If I do so, the state may legitimately require that I pay for that privilege. The third justification distinguishes between the rights to enjoy and to hold through time. The former does not involve the state in any way, other than in non-interference, but the latter may, through the need for protection. If the state is to provide this protection it may legitimately charge a fee for this, and this fee may take the form of a tax on the holding of property.

d. The Social Fund

As common ownership theories typically involve the imposition of taxes, they need to determine how the social fund created by these taxes is to be applied. One natural way to do this is to specify that the social fund be distributed to everyone in equal shares. As an alternative, Nozick, with respect to the case where the social fund is collected explicitly to rectify historical injustices, suggests that the fund be distributed in such a way that the end result is close to Rawls’s difference principle.

A radically different way of dividing the social fund would be to use it to compensate those with unchosen disadvantages, as would be justified, for example, by the argument that such disadvantages were morally arbitrary. There is, however, something perverse about any proposal to apply the social fund in a way that compensates for unchosen personal endowments when all means of collecting the taxes that form that fund have, because of an adherence to the self-ownership principle, ruled out taxing people on that basis. As Fried expresses it, “schemes, which judge the tax and transfer sides of fiscal policy by wholly different distributive criteria, seem morally incoherent” (2004, 90).

e. Summary

The strength of common ownership theories is that, as Fried puts it, they “have staked out a middle ground between the two dominant strains of contemporary political philosophy: the conventional libertarianism of those such as Robert Nozick on the right, and the egalitarianism of those such as Rawls, Dworkin, and Sen on the left” (2004, 67). However, the open question remains as to whether such theories are, in Fried’s terms, “just liberal egalitarianism in drag” (2004, 84).

6. Conclusions

As regards internal consistency, Dworkin’s equality of resources theory may have the greatest problems. Some of the problems with Dworkin’s auction construction may be avoided by adopting its outcome, of an equal wealth equilibrium, as a specification of justice in its own right. The insurance scheme, however, has more serious and unavoidable problems. The fundamental flaw is that shown by Roemer: that no Dworkinian scheme can satisfy four very weak consistency conditions, so that “resource egalitarianism is an incoherent notion”.

Rawlsian justice as fairness fares a little better, but, if it is to be grounded in choice from behind a veil of ignorance, has the serious flaws of that construction. Some of these can be avoided by inessential changes, but other problems are unavoidable, particularly those of identifying the least advantaged (with the related problems of defining primary goods and the construction of an index of these), and of the supposedly rational choice of the maximin principle with its “absurd practical implications”.

Common ownership theories, being diverse, are harder to assess as a group. Theories that involve interventions of the transfer of property have a variety of arbitrariness problems, and typically violate some aspect of the principle of free association. Those that involve interventions on the holding of property have, on the whole, some serious arbitrariness problems, particularly as regards the definition of property.

Nozickian entitlements theory may have the fewest problems of consistency. But although they may be few they are not trivial, particularly those relating to justice in initial acquisition, and to the rectification of past injustice.

It is not clear that it is useful, let alone possible, to identify some most satisfactory theory of justice, and thus identify some most appropriate point in the liberty-equality spectrum. Since self-ownership is a cornerstone of liberty, the problem is given specific focus in Cohen’s claim that “anyone who supports equality of condition must oppose (full) self-ownership, even in a world in which rights over external resources have been equalized” (1995, 72).

In an absolute sense, it seems hard to disagree with Cohen. There may, however, be some room for compromise. From one end of the spectrum, equality of resources moves in that direction, particularly in making Rawlsian egalitarianism more ambition-sensitive without at the same time making it more endowment-sensitive. From the other end, some versions of common ownership also move in that direction. This is particularly the case for versions that embody rectification of past injustice: as Nozick accepts, “although to introduce socialism as the punishment for our sins would be to go too far, past injustices might be so great as to make necessary in the short run a more extensive state in order to rectify them” (1974, 231).

If an accommodation is to be found, it will be found towards the centre of the liberty-equality spectrum, that is, in equality of resources or in common ownership theories. Given the greater internal problems of the former, the latter may prove to be the more fruitful. However, common ownership theories are diverse, so this does not provide a complete prescription. But as Nozick reminds us, “there is room for words on subjects other than last words” (1974, xii).

7. References and Further Reading

a. References

  • Allingham, M. (2014) Distributive Justice, London, Routledge.
  • Arrow, K. J. (2012) Social Choice and Individual Values (third edition), New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Cohen, G. A. (1989) “On the currency of egalitarian justice”, Ethics, 99: 906-944.
  • Cohen, G. A. (1995) Self-Ownership, Freedom, and Equality, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dworkin, R. (1981) “What is equality? Part 2: equality of resources”, Philosophy & Public Affairs 10: 283-345.
  • Fried, B. (2004) “Left-libertarianism: a review essay”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 32: 66–92.
  • Hammond, P. J. (1991) “Interpersonal comparisons of utility: why and how they are and should be made”, in Interpersonal Comparisons of Well-Being (editors J. Elster and J. E. Roemer) Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 200-254.
  • Harsanyi, J. (1977) “Morality and the theory of rational behavior”, Social Research, 44; reprinted in Utilitarianism and Beyond (editors A. Sen and B. Williams) Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 39-62.
  • Hume, D. (1751/1998) An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by T. L. Beauchamp, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Locke, J. (1689/1988) Two Treatises of Government, edited by P. Laslett, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Nozick, R. (1974) Anarchy, State, and Utopia, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Rawls, J. (1999) A Theory of Justice (revised edition), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Rawls, J. (2005) Political Liberalism (expanded edition), New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Roemer, J. E. (1985) “Equality of talent”, Economics and Philosophy, 1: 151-187.
  • Roemer, J. E. (1996) Theories of Distributive Justice, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Sandel, M. J. (2009) Justice: What’s the Right Thing to Do?, Allen Lane: London.
  • Scanlon, T. (1991) “The moral basis of interpersonal comparisons”, in Interpersonal Comparisons of Well-Being (editors J. Elster and J. E. Roemer) Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 17-44.
  • Steiner, H. (1977) “Justice and entitlement”, Ethics, 87: 150-152
  • Steiner, H. (1994) An Essay on Rights, Cambridge, MA: Blackwell.

b. Further Reading

  • Overviews
  • Vallentyne, P. (2007) “Distributive justice”, in A Companion to Contemporary Political Philosophy (editors R. Goodin, P. Pettit, and T. Pogge), Oxford: Blackwell, 548-562.
  • Wellman, C. H. (2002) “Justice”, in The Blackwell Guide to Social and Political Philosophy (edited by R. L. Simon), Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Justice as fairness
  • Freeman, S. (editor) (2003) The Cambridge Companion to Rawls, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Equality of resources
  • Brown, A. (2009) Ronald Dworkin’s Theory of Equality, London: Macmillan.
  • Entitlements
  • Bader R. M. and Meadowcroft J. (editors) (2011) The Cambridge Companion to Nozick's Anarchy, State, and Utopia, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Common ownership
  • Vallentyne, P. and Steiner, H. (editors) (2000) Left Libertarianism and Its Critics: The Contemporary Debate, Basingstoke: Palgrave.


Author Information

Michael Allingham
Oxford University
United Kingdom

Applied Ethics

Under what conditions is an abortion morally permissible?  Does a citizen have a moral obligation to actively participate (perhaps by voting) in the democratic process of one’s nation (assuming one is living in a democracy)?  What obligations, if any, does one have to the global poor?  Under what conditions is female genital excision morally permissible?  If there are conditions under which it is morally wrong, what measures, if any, should be taken against the practice?  These are just some of the thousands of questions that applied ethicists consider. Applied ethics is often referred to as a component study of the wider sub-discipline of ethics within the discipline of philosophy. This does not mean that only philosophers are applied ethicists, or that fruitful applied ethics is only done within academic philosophy departments. In fact, there are those who believe that a more informed approach is best gotten outside of the academy, or at least certainly outside of philosophy. This article, though, will mostly focus on how applied ethics is approached by trained academic philosophers, or by those trained in very closely related disciplines.

This article first locates applied ethics as distinct from, but nevertheless related to, two other branches of ethics. Since the content of what is studied by applied ethicists is so varied, and since working knowledge of the field requires considerable empirical knowledge, and since historically the pursuit of applied ethics has been done by looking at different kinds of human practices, it only makes sense that there will be many different kinds of applied ethical research, such that an expert working in one kind will not have much to say in another. For example, business ethics is a field of applied ethics, and so too is bioethics. There are plenty of experts in one field that have nothing to say in the other. This article discusses each field, highlighting just some of the many issues that fall within each. Throughout the presentation of the different areas of applied ethics, some methodological issues continue to come up. Additionally, the other two branches of ethics are consulted in dealing with many of the issues of almost all the different fields. So, what may be a methodological worry for a business ethics issue may also be a worry for bioethical issues.

One particular kind of applied ethics that raises distinct concerns is bioethics. Whereas with other kinds of applied ethics it is usually implicit that the issue involves those who we already know to have moral standing, bioethical issues, such as abortion, often involve beings whose moral standing is much more contentious. Our treatment of non-human animals is another area of bioethical research that often hinges on what moral standing these animals have. As such, it is important that this article devote a section to the issues that arise concerning moral standing and personhood.

This article ends with a discussion of the role of moral psychology in applied ethics, and in particular how applied ethicists might appropriate social psychological knowledge for the purpose of understanding the role of emotion in the formation of moral judgments. Additionally, to what extent is it important to understand the role of culture in not only what is valued but in how practices are to be morally evaluated?

Table of Contents

  1. Applied Ethics as Distinct from Normative Ethics and Metaethics
  2. Business Ethics
    1. Corporate Social Responsibility
    2. Corporations and Moral Agency
    3. Deception in Business
    4. Multinational Enterprises
  3. Bioethics
    1. Beginning of Life Issues, including Abortion
    2. End of Life Issues
    3. Research, Patients, Populations, and Access
  4. Moral Standing and Personhood
    1. Theories of Moral Standing and Personhood
    2. The Moral Status of Non-Human Animals
  5. Professional Ethics
    1. What is a Profession?
    2. Engineering Ethics
  6. Social Ethics, Distributive Justice, and Environmental Ethics
    1. Social Ethics
    2. Distributive Justice, and Famine Relief
    3. Environmental Ethics
  7. Theory and Application
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Applied Ethics as Distinct from Normative Ethics and Metaethics

One way of categorizing the field of ethics (as a study of morality) is by distinguishing between its three branches, one of them being applied ethics. By contrasting applied ethics with the other branches, one can get a better understanding what exactly applied ethics is about. The three branches are metaethics, normative ethics (sometimes referred to as ethical theory), and applied ethics. Metaethics deals with whether morality exists. Normative ethics, usually assuming an affirmative answer to the existence question, deals with the reasoned construction of moral principles, and at its highest level, determines what the fundamental principle of morality is. Applied ethics, also usually assuming an affirmative answer to the existence question, addresses the moral permissibility of specific actions and practices.

Although there are many avenues of research in metaethics, one main avenue starts with the question of whether or not moral judgments are truth-apt. The following will illuminate this question. Consider the following claims:  ‘2+2=4’, ‘The volume of an organic cell expands at a greater rate than its surface area’, ‘AB=BA, for all A,B matrices’, and ‘Joel enjoys white wine.’  All of these claims are either true or false; the first two are true, the latter two are false, and there are ways in which to determine the truth or falsity of them. But how about the claim ‘Natalie’s torturing of Nate’s dog for the mere fun of it is morally wrong’?  A large proportion of people, and perhaps cross-culturally, will say that this claim is true (and hence truth-apt). But it’s not quite as obvious how this claim is truth-apt in the way that the other claims are truth-apt. There are axioms and observations (sometime through scientific instruments) which support the truth-aptness of the claims above, but it’s not so clear that truth-aptness is gotten through these means with respect to the torturing judgment. So, it is the branch of metaethics that deals with this question, and not applied ethics.

Normative ethics is concerned with principles of morality. This branch itself can be divide into various sub-branches (and in various ways):  consequentialist theories, deontological theories, and virtue-based theories. A consequentialist theory says that an action is morally permissible if and only if it maximizes overall goodness (relative to its alternatives). Consequentialist theories are specified according to what they take to be (intrinsically) good. For example, classical utilitarians considered intrinsic goodness to be happiness/pleasure. Modern utilitarians, on the other hand, define goodness in terms of things like preference-satisfaction, or even well-being. Other kinds of consequentialists will consider less subjective criteria for goodness. But, setting aside the issue of what constitutes goodness, there is a rhetorical argument supporting consequentialist theories:  How could it ever be wrong to do what’s best overall?  (I take this straight from Robert N. Johnson.)  Although intuitively the answer is that it couldn’t be wrong to do what’s best overall, there are a plentitude of purported counterexamples to consequentialism on this point – on what might be called “the maximizing component” of consequentialism. For example, consider the Transplant Problem, in which the only way to save five dying people is by killing one person for organ transplantation to the five. Such counterexamples draw upon another kind of normative/ethical theory – namely, deontological theory. Such theories either place rights or duties as fundamental to morality. The idea is that there are certain constraints placed against persons/agents in maximizing overall goodness. One is not morally permitted to save five lives by cutting up another person for organ transplantation because the one person has a right against any person to be treated in this way. Similarly, there is a duty for all people to make sure that they do not treat others in a way that merely makes them a means to the end of maximizing overall goodness, whatever that may be. Finally, we have virtue theories. Such theories are motivated by the idea that what’s fundamental to morality is not what one ought to do, but rather what one ought to be. But given that we live in a world of action, of doing, the question of what one ought to do creeps up. Therefore, according to such theories, what one ought to do is what the ideally virtuous person would do. What should I do?  Well, suppose I’ve become the kind of person I want to be. Then whatever I do from there is what I should do now. This theory is initially appealing, but nevertheless, there are lots of problems with it, and we cannot get into them for an article like this.

Applied ethics, unlike the other two branches, deals with questions that started this article – for example, under what conditions is an abortion morally permissible?  And, what obligations, if any, do we have toward the world’s global poor?  Notice the specificity compared to the other two branches. Already, though, one might wonder whether the way to handle these applied problems is by applying one of the branches. So, if it’s the case that morality doesn’t exist (or: moral judgments are not truth-apt), then we can just say that any claims about the permissibility of abortion or global duties to the poor are not true (in virtue of not being truth-apt), and there is therefore no problem; applied ethics is finished. It’s absolutely crucial that we are able to show that morality exists (that moral judgments are truth-apt) in order for applied ethics to get off the ground.

Actually, this may be wrong. It might be the case that even if we are in error about morality existing, we can nevertheless give reasons which support our illusions in specified cases. More concretely, there really is no truth of the matter about the moral permissibility of abortion, but that does not stop us from considering whether we should have legislation that places constraints on it. Perhaps there are other reasons which would support answers to this issue. The pursuit and discussion of these (purported) reasons would be an exercise in applied ethics. Similarly, suppose that there is no such thing as a fundamental principle of morality; this does not exclude, for one thing, the possibility of actions and practices from being morally permissible and impermissible/wrong. Furthermore, suppose we go with the idea that there is a finite list of principles that comprise a theory (with no principle being fundamental). There are those who think that we can determine, and explain, the rightness/wrongness of actions and practices without this list of non-fundamental principles. (We’ll look at this later in this article)  If this is the case, then we can do applied ethics without an explicit appeal to normative ethics.

In summary, we should consider whether or not the three branches are as distinct as we might think that they are. Of course, the principle questions of each are distinct, and as such, each branch is in fact distinct. But it appears that in doing applied ethics one must (or less strongly, may) endeavor into the other two branches. Suppose that one wants to come to the conclusion that our current treatment of non-human animals, more specifically our treatment of chickens in their mass production in chicken warehouses, is morally impermissible. Then, if one stayed away from consequentialist theories, they would have either a deontological or virtue-based theory to approach this issue. Supposing they dismissed virtue-theory (on normative ethical grounds), they would then approach the issue from deontology. Suppose further, they chose a rights-based theory. Then they would have to defend the existence of rights, or at least appeal to a defense of rights found within the literature. What reasons do we have to think that rights exist?  This then looks like a metaethical question. As such, even before being able to appeal to the issue of whether we’re doing right by chickens in our manufactured slaughtering of them, we have to do some normative ethics and metaethics. Yes, the three branches are distinct, but they are also related.

2. Business Ethics

Some people might think that business ethics is an oxymoron. How can business, with all of its shady dealings, be ethical?  This is a view that can be taken even by well educated people. But in the end, such a position is incorrect. Ethics is a study of morality, and business practices are fundamental to human existence, dating back at least to agrarian society, if not even to pre-agrarian existence. Business ethics then is a study of the moral issues that arise when human beings exchange goods and services, where such exchanges are fundamental to our daily existence. Not only is business ethics not something oxymoronical, it is important.

a. Corporate Social Responsibility

One important issue concerns the social responsibility of corporate executives, in particular those taking on the role of a CEO. In an important sense, it is stockholders, and not corporate executives (via their role as executives), who own a corporation. As such, a CEO is an employee, not an owner, of a corporation. And who is their employer?  The stockholders. Who are they, the CEO and other executives, directly accountable to?  The board of directors, representing the stockholders. As such, there is the view taken by what’s called stockholder theorists, that the sole responsibility of a CEO is to do what the stockholders demand (as expressed by the collective decision of the board of directors), and usually that demand is to maximize profits. Therefore, according to stockholder theory, the sole responsibility of the CEO is to, through their business abilities and knowledge, maximize profit. (Friedman, 1967)

The contesting viewpoint is stakeholder theory. Stakeholders include not just stockholders but also employees, consumers, and communities. In other words, anyone who has a stake in the operations of a corporation is a stakeholder of that corporation. According to stakeholder theory, a corporate executive has moral responsibilities to all stakeholders. Thus, although some corporate ventures and actions might maximize profit, they may conflict with the demands of employees, consumers, or communities. Stakeholder theory very nicely accounts for what some might consider to be a pre-theoretical commitment – namely, that an action should be assessed in terms of how it affects everyone involved by it, not just a select group based on something morally arbitrary. Stakeholder theorists can claim that the stakeholders are everyone affected by a business’s decision, and not just the stockholders. To consider only stockholders is to focus on a select group based on something that is morally arbitrary.

There are at least two problems for stakeholder theory worth discussing. First, as was mentioned above, there are conflicts between stockholders and the rest of stakeholders. A stakeholder account has to handle such conflicts. There are various ways of handling such conflicts. For example, some theorists take a Rawlsian approach, by which corporate decisions are to be made in accordance with what will promote the least well-off.  (Freeman, 2008)  Another kind of Rawlsian approach is to endorse the use of the veil of ignorance without appeal to the Difference Principle, whereby it might result that what is morally correct is actually more in line with the stockholders (Dittmer, 2010). Additionally, there are other decision making principles by which one could appeal in order to resolve conflict. Such stakeholder theories will then be assessed according to the plausibility of their decision making theories (resolving conflict) and their ability to achieve intuitive results in particular cases.

Another challenge of some stakeholder theories will be their ability to make some metaphysical sense of such entities as community, as well as making sense of potentially affecting a group of people. If a corporate decision is criticized in terms of it affecting a community, then we should keep in mind what is meant by community. It is not as if there is an actual person that is a community. As such, it is hard to understand how a community can be morally wronged, like a person can be wronged. Furthermore, if the decisions of a corporate executive are to be measured according to stakeholder theory, then we need to be clearer about who counts as a stakeholder. There are plenty of products and services that could potentially affect a number of people that we might not initially consider. Should such potential people be counted as stakeholders?  This is a question to be considered for stakeholder theorists. Stockholder theorists could even us this question as a rhetorical push for their own theory. 

b. Corporations and Moral Agency

In the media, corporations are portrayed as moral agents: “Microsoft unveiled their latest software”, “Ford morally blundered with their decision to not refit their Pinto with the rubber bladder design”, and “Apple has made strides to be the company to emulate”, are the types of comments heard on a regular basis. Independently of whether or not these claims are true, each of these statements relies on there being such a thing as corporations having some kind of agency. More specifically, given that intuitively corporations do things that result in morally good and bad things, it makes sense to ask whether such corporations are the kind of entities that can be moral agents. For instance, take an individual human being, of normal intelligence. Many of us are comfortable with judging her actions as morally right or wrong, and also holding onto the idea that she is a moral agent, eligible for moral evaluation. The question relative to business ethics is:  Are corporations moral agents?   Are they the kind of thing capable of being evaluated in such a way as to determine if they are either morally good or bad?

There are those who do think so. Peter French has argued that corporations are moral agents. It is not just that we can evaluate such entities as shorthand for the major players involved in corporate practices and policies. Instead, there is a thing over and above the major players which is the corporation, and it is this thing that can be morally evaluated. French postulates what's called a “Corporate Internal Decision Structure” (CID structure), whereby we can understand a corporation over and above its major players as a moral agent. French astutely observes that any being that is a moral agent has to be capable of intentionality – that is, the being has to have intentions. It is through the CID structure that we can make sense of a corporation as having intentions, and as such as being a moral agent. (French, 1977). One intuitive idea driving CID structures as supporting the intentionality of corporations is that there are rules and regulations within a corporation that drives it to make decisions that no one individual within it can make. Certain decisions might require either majority or unanimous approval of all individuals recognized in the decision-making process. Those decisions then are a result of the rules regulating what is required for decision, and not any particular go ahead of any individual. As such, we have intentionality independent of any particular human agent.

But there are those who oppose this idea of corporate moral agency. Now, there are various reasons one might oppose it. In being a moral agent, it is usually granted that one then gets to have certain rights. (Notice here a metaethical and normative ethical issue concerning the status of rights and whether or not to think of morality in terms of rights respect and violation.)  If corporations are moral agents with rights, then this might allow for too much moral respect for corporations. That is, corporations would be entities that would have to have their rights respected, in so far as we're concerned with following the standard thoughts of what moral agency entails – that is, having both obligations and rights.

But there are also more metaphysical reasons supporting the idea that corporations are not moral agents. For example, John Danley gives various reasons, many of them metaphysical in nature, against the idea that corporations are moral agents (Danley, 1980). Danley agrees with French that intention is a necessary condition for moral agency. But is it a sufficient condition?  French sympathizers might reply that even if  it is not a sufficient condition, its being a necessary condition gives reason to believe that in the case of corporations it is sufficient. Danley then can be interpreted as responding to this argument. He gives various considerations under which theoretically defined intentional corporations are nevertheless not moral agents. In particular, such corporations fail to meet some other conditions intuitively present with other moral agents, namely most human beings. Danley writes “The corporation cannot be kicked, whipped, imprisoned, or hanged by the neck until dead. Only individuals of the corporation can be punished” (Danley, 1980). Danley then considers financial punishments. But then he reminds us that it is individuals who have to pay the costs. It could be the actual culprits, the major players. Or, it could be the stockholders, in loss of profits, or perhaps the downfall of the company. And furthermore, it could be the loss of jobs of employees; so, innocents may be affected.

In the literature, French does reply to Danley, as well as to the worries of others. Certainly, there is room for disagreement and discussion. Hopefully, it can be seen that this is an important issue, and that room for argumentative maneuver is possible.

c. Deception in Business

Deception is usually considered to be a bad thing, in particular something that is morally bad. Whenever one is being deceptive, one is doing something morally wrong. But this kind of conventional wisdom could be questioned. In fact, it is questioned by Albert Carr in his famous piece “Is Business Bluffing Ethical?”  (Carr, 1968). There are at least three arguments one can take from this piece. In this section, we will explore them.

The most obvious argument is his Poker Analogy Argument. It goes something like this:  (1) Deception in poker is morally permissible, perhaps morally required. (2) Business is like poker. (3) Therefore, deception in business is morally permissible. Now, obviously, this argument is overly simplified, and certain modifications should be made. In poker, there are certain things that are not allowed; you could be in some serious trouble if it were found out what you were doing. So, for example, the introduction of winning cards slid into the mix would not be tolerated. As such, we can grant that such sliding would not be morally permissible. Similarly, any kind of business practice that would be considered sliding according to Carr's analogy would also not be permissible.

But there are some obvious permitted kinds of deception involved in poker, even if it's disliked by the losing parties. Similarly, there will be deceptive practices in business that, although disliked, will be permitted. Here is one objection though. Whereas, the loser of deception in poker is the player, the loser of deception in business is a wide group of people. Whether we go with stockholder theory or stakeholder theory, we are going to have losers/victims that had nothing to do with the poker/deceptive playing of the corporative executives. Employees, for example, could lose their jobs because of the deception of either corporate executive of competing companies or the bad deception of the home companies. Here is a response, though:  When one is involved in corporate culture, as employee for example, they take on the gamble that the corporate executives take on. There are other ways to respond to this charge, as well.

The second reason one might side with Carr's deception thesis is based on a meta-theoretical position. One might take the metaethical position that moral judgments are truth-apt, but that they are categorically false. So, we might think that a certain action is morally wrong when in fact there is no such thing as moral wrongness. When we make claims condemning a moral practice we are saying something false. As such, condemning deception in business is really just saying something false, as all moral judgments are false. The way to reply to this worry is then through a metaethical route, where one argues against such a theory, which is called Error Theory.

The third reason one might side with Carr is via what appears to be a discussion, on his part, of the difference between ordinary morality and business morality. Yes, in ordinary morality, deception is not morally permissible. But with business morality, it is not only permissible but also required. We are misled in judging business practices by the standards of ordinary morality, and so, deception in business is in fact morally permissible. One response is this is:  Following Carr's lead, one is to divide her life into two significant components. They are to spend their professional life in such a way that involves deception, but then spend the rest of their life, day by day, in a way that is not deceptive with their family and friends, outside of work. This kind of self looks very much like a divisive self, a self that is conflicted and perhaps tyrannical.

d. Multinational Enterprises

Business is now done globally. This does not just mean the trivial statement of global exchange of goods and services between nations. Instead, it means that goods and services are produced by other nations (often underdeveloped) for the exchange between nations that do not partake in the production of such goods and services.

There are various ways to define multiple national enterprises (MNE's). Let us consider this definition, though: An MNE is a company that produces at least some of its goods or services in a nation that is distinct from (i) where it is located and (ii) its consumer base. Nike would be a good example of a MNE. The existence of MNE's is motivated by the fact that in other nations, an MNE could produce more at lesser cost, usually due to the fact that in such other nations wage laws are either absent or such that paying employees in such countries is much less than in the host nation. As a hypothetical example, a company could either pay 2000 employees $12/hr for production of their goods in their own country or they could pay 4000 employees $1.20/hr in a foreign country. The cheaper alternative is going with the employment in the foreign country. Suppose an MNE goes this route. What could morally defend such a position?

One way to defend the MNE route is by citing empirical facts concerning the average wages of the producing nation. If, for example, the average way is $.80/hr, then one could say that such jobs are justified in virtue of providing opportunities to make higher wages than otherwise. To be concrete, $1.20 is more than $.80, and so such jobs are justified.

There are at least two ways to respond. First, one might cite the wrongness of relocating jobs from the host nation to the other nation. This is a good response, except that it does not do well in answering to pre-theoretical commitment concerning fairness:  Why should those in a nation receiving $12/hr be privileged over those in a nation receiving $1.20/hr?   Why do the $12/hr people count more than the $1.20/hr people?  Notice that utilitarian responses will have to deal with how the world could be made better (and not necessarily morally better). Second, one might take the route of Richard Miller. He proposes that the $1.20/hr people are being exploited, and it is not because they are doing worse off than they would otherwise. He agrees that they are doing better than they would otherwise ($1.20/hr is better than $.80/hr). It's just that their cheapness of labor is determined according to what they would get otherwise. They should not be offered such wages because doing so exploits their vulnerability of already having to work for unjust compensation; being compensated for a better wage than the wage they would get under unjust conditions does not mean that the better wage is just (Miller, 2010).

3. Bioethics

Bioethics is a very exciting field of study, filled with issues concerning the most basic concerns of human beings and their close relatives. In some sense, the term bioethics is a bit ridiculous, as almost anything of ethical concern is biological, and certainly anything that is sentient is of ethical concern. (Note that with silicon based sentient beings, what I say is controversial, and perhaps false.)  Bioethics, then, should be understood as a study of morality as it concerns issues dealing with the biological issues and facts concerning ourselves, and our close relatives, for examples, almost any non-human animal that is sentient. This part of the article will be divided into three sections: beginning of life issues, including abortion; end of life issues, for example euthanasia; and finally, ethical concerns doing medical research, as well as availability of medical care.

a. Beginning of Life Issues, including Abortion

All of the beginning of life issue are contentious. There are four for us to consider:  abortion, stem-cell procurement and research, cloning, and future generations. Each of these big issues (they could be considered research fields themselves) are related to each other.

Let us start with abortion. Instead of asking 'Is abortion morally permissible?' a better question will be 'Under what conditions is an abortion morally permissible?'. In looking at the conditions surrounding a particular abortion, we are able to get a better understanding of all of the possibly morally relevant considerations in determining permissibility/impermissibility. Now, this does not exclude the possibility of a position where all abortions are morally wrong. It's just that we have to start with the conditions, and then proceed from there.

Up until just 40 or so years ago, the conventional wisdom, at least displayed in the academic literature, was that just so long as a fetus is a person (or counts morally), it would be morally wrong to abort it. Judith Thomson challenged the received wisdom by positing a number of cases that would show, at least as she argued, that even with a fetus being a person, with all of the rights we would confer to any other person, it would still be permissible to abort, under certain conditions (Thomson, 1971). So, for example, with her Violinist Case, it's permissible for a pregnant woman to abort a fetus under the circumstances that she was raped, even with the granting that the aborted fetus is a full-fledged person. Three remarks should be made here. First, there are those who have questioned whether her case actually establishes this very important conclusion. Second, it should be recognized that it's not completely clear what all of the points Thomson is making with her Violinist Case. Is she saying something fundamentally about the morality of abortion?  Or is she saying something fundamentally about the nature and structure of moral rights?  Or both?  Minimally, we should be sensitive to the fact that Thomson is saying something important, even if false, about the nature of moral rights. Third, and this is very important, Thomson's Violinist Case, if successful, only shows the permissibility of abortion in cases where the pregnant woman was raped, where conception occurred due to non-consensual sex. But what about consensual sex?

Thomson does have a way to answer this question. She continues in her essay with another case, called Peopleseeds. (Thomson, 1971)  Imagine a woman (or, perhaps a man) who enjoys her days off in her house with the windows open. It just so happens that she lives in a world in which there are these things called peopleseeds, such that if they make their way into a house's carpet, they will root and eventually develop, unless uprooted, into full-fledged people (perhaps only human infants). Knowing this, she takes precautions and places a mesh screen in her windows. Nevertheless, there are risks, in that it's possible, and has been documented, that seeds come through the window. She places the screens in, and because she enjoys Saturdays with her windows open, she leaves her windows open (actually just one), thereby eventually allowing a seed to root, and there she has a problematic person growing. She then decides to uproot the seed, thereby killing the peopleseed. Has she done anything wrong?  Intuitively, the answer is no. Therefore, even in cases of pregnancy due to consensual sex, and with the consideration that the fetus is a person, it is morally permissible to abort it. It's interesting, though, that very little has been said in the literature to this case; or, there has been very little that has caught on in such a way that is reflected in more basic bioethics texts. One way to question Thomson with this case is by noting that she is having us consult our intuitions about a world where its biological laws are different than ours; it is just not the case that we live in a world (universe) where this kind of fetal development can happen. Perhaps in the world in which this can occur, it would be considered morally wrong by such inhabitants of that world to kill such peopleseed fetuses. Or maybe not. It is, minimally, hard to know.

Thomson's essay is revolutionary, groundbreaking, more-than-important, and perhaps ““true””. What is so important about it is the idea of arguing for the permissibility of abortion, even with fetuses being considered persons, just like us.  There are others who significantly expand on her approach. Frances Kamm, for example, does so in her Creation and Abortion. This is a sophisticated deontological approach to abortion. Kamm notices certain problems with Thomson's argument, but then offers various reasons which would support the permissibility of aborting. She takes into consideration such things as third party intervention and morally responsible creation (Kamm, 1992).

Note that I have mentioned Kamm's deontological approach, where the rights and duties of those involved matter. Also note that with a utilitarian approach, such things as rights and duties are going to be missing, and if they are there, it is only in terms of understanding what will maximize overall goodness/utility. According to utilitarianism, abortion is going to be settled according to whether policies for or against maximize overall goodness/utility. There is a third approach, though. This approach draws from the third major kind of ethical theory, namely virtue theory. In general, virtue theory says that an action is morally permissible if and only if it is what an ideally virtuous person would do. Such a theory sounds very intuitive.  Rosalind Hursthouse argues that it is through virtue theory that we can best understand the issues surrounding abortion. She, I think controversially, asks questions about the personal state under which a woman becomes pregnant. It is from her becoming-pregnant state that we are to understand whether her possible abortion is morally permissible. Perhaps a more generous reading of Hursthouse is that we need to understand where a woman is at in her life to best evaluate whether or not an abortion is morally appropriate for her (Hursthouse, 1991).

There are, of course, the downright naysayers to abortion. Almost all take the position that all fetuses are persons, and thereby, aborting a fetus is tantamount to (wrongful) murder. Any successful position should take on Thomson's essay. Some, though, might bypass her thoughts, and just say that abortion is the killing of an innocent person, and any killing of an innocent person is morally wrong.

Let's end, though, with a discussion of an approach against abortion that allows for the fetus to not be a person, and to not have any (supposed) moral standing. This is clever, as Thomson's argument attempts to show that aborting a person is permissible, and this approach shows that aborting a non-person is impermissible. We see very quickly, though, that this argument is different than the potentiality argument against abortion. The potentiality argument says that some x is a potential person, and therefore the aborting of it is wrong because had x not been aborted, it would eventually had been a person.  This argument, on the other hand, does not appeal to potentiality, and furthermore, does not assume that the fetus is a person. Don Marquis argues that aborting a fetus is wrong on the grounds that explains the wrongness of any killing of people. Namely, what is wrong with killing a person?  It is that in killing a person, the person is being deprived of a future life. A future life contains quite a bit of things, including in general joy and suffering. In killing a fetus via abortion one is depriving it of a future life, even if it is not a person. It's future life is just like ours; it contains joy and suffering. By killing it, you are depriving it of the same things that are deprived of us if we are killed. The same explanation of why it's wrong to kill us applies to fetuses; therefore, it's wrong to abort under all cases (with some exceptions) (Marquis, 1989).

Another beginning of life issue is stem cell research. Stem cell research is important because it provides avenues for the development of organs and tissues that can be used to replace those that are diseased for those suffering from certain medical conditions; in theory, an entire cardiac system could be generated through stem cells, as well as through all of the research required on stem cells in order to eventually produce successful organ systems. There are various routes by which stem cell lines can be procured, and this is where things get controversial. First, though, how are stem cells generally produced in general, in the abstract?  Answering this question first requires specifying what is meant by stem cells. Stem cells are undifferentiated cells, ones that are pluripotent, or more colloquially, ones that can divide and eventually become a number of many different kinds of cells – for example, blood cells, nerve cells, and cells specific to kinds of tissues, for example, muscles, heart, stomach, intestine, prostate, and so forth. A differentiated, non-pluripotent cell is no good for producing pluripotent cells; such a cell is not a candidate for stem cell lines.

And so, how are stem cells produced, abstractly?  Stem cells, given that they must come from a human clump of matter that is not no good, are extracted from an embryo – a cluster of cells that are of both the differentiated and undifferentiated (stem cell) sort. The undifferentiated, pluripotent cells are extracted from the embryo in order to then be specialized into a number of different kind of cells – for example, cells developing into cardiac tissue. Such extraction amounts to the destruction of the human clump of matter - that is, the destruction of the human embryo, and some claim that is tantamount to murder. More mildly, one could condemn such stem cell procurement as an unjustified killing of something that morally counts. Now, it is important to note that such opponents of stem cell line procurement, in the way characterized, will note that there are alternative ways to get the stem cell lines. They will point out that we can get stem cells from already existing adult cells which are differentiated, non-pluripotent. There are techniques that can then “non-specialize” them back into a pluripotent,  undifferentiated state, without having to destroy an embryo for procurement of stem cells; basically, we can get the stem cells without having to kill something, an embryo, that counts morally.

There are some very good responses to those who are opponents of stem cell procurement in the typical (embryo destruction) manner. Typically, they will resort to the idea that such destruction is merely a destruction of something that doesn't morally count. The idea is that embryos, at least of the kind that are used and destroyed in getting stem cells, are not the kind of thing that morally counts. The sophistication of such embryos is such that they are very early stage embryos, comparable to the kinds of embryos one would find in the early stages of the first trimester of a natural pregnancy.

There are other considerations that proponents of typical stem cell procurement will appeal to. For example, they might give a response to certain slippery slope arguments against (typical) stem cell procurement (Holm, 2007). The main kind of slippery slope argument against stem cell research is that if we allow such procurement and research, then this leaves open the door to the practice of the cloning of full-scale human beings. A rather reasonable way of responding to this worry is two-fold:  If the cloning of full-scale human beings is not problematic, then this is not a genuine slippery slope as, in the words of one author, “there is no slope in the first place” (Holm, 2007). The idea is that, all other things equal, human cloning is not morally problematic, and there is therefore no moral worry about stem cell procurement causing human cloning to come about, as human cloning is not a morally bad thing. But suppose that human cloning (on a full scale) is morally problematic. Then proponents of stem cell procurement will then need to give reasons why stem cell procurement and research won't cause/lead to human cloning, and there are plausible, but still controversial, reasons that can be given to support this defense. To summarize, there is a slope, but it is not slippery (Holm, 2007).

A third beginning of life issue, which follows quite nicely from the previous discussion, is that of human cloning. There are those who argue that human cloning is wrong, and for various reasons. One could first go with the repugnance route. It's repugnant to create human beings through this route. One way to respond to this is by noting that it certainly would be different, at least for a period of time, but that such difference, perhaps resulting in the feeling of repugnance, is by itself no reason to think that the practice (of human cloning) is morally wrong. Furthermore, one might say that with any kind of moral progress, feelings of repugnance by some of the population does occur, but that such repugnance is just an effect of moral change; if the moral change is actual progress, then such repugnance is merely the reaction to a change which is actually morally good.

Another way in which cloning may be criticized is that it could lead to a Brave New World world. By cloning, we are controlling people's destinies, in such a way that what we get is a dystopian result. The best response to this is that such a worry relies on a kind of genetic reductionism which is false. Are we merely the product of our genetic composition?  No. There are plenty of early childhood factors, as well as in general cultural/social factors, which explain the kind of people we are by the time we are adults. Of course, a Brave New World world is possible, but it is possibility is best understood in terms of all of the cultural and social factors that would have to be present to have such complacent and brain-dead people characterized in the book; they aren't born that way – they are socialized that way. The mere genetic replication of people, through cloning, should be less of a worry, given that there are so many other factors, social, that are relevant in explaining adult behavior.

The second way to criticize human cloning is that it closes the open future of the resulting clone. By cloning a person, P1, we are creating P2. Given that P1 has lived perhaps 52 years, P2 then has knowledge of what her life will be like in the next 52 years. Suppose that the 52 year old writes a very self-honest autobiography. Then P2 now can read how her life will unfold. Once again, this objection to cloning relies on a very ridiculous way of looking at the narrative of a human life; it requires a very, very strong kind of genetic reductionism, and it flies in the face of the results of twin studies. (Note that a human clone is biologically a delayed human twin.)  So, the response to the open future objection can be summed up as this:  A human clone might have their future closed, but it would only be in virtue of anyone else's future being closed, which would require lots of knowledge about social/cultural/economic knowledge of their future life. Given that these things are very unpredictable, as for everyone else, it's safe to say that such human clones will not have knowledge of how their life will unfold; as such, they, just like anyone else, have an open future.

b. End of Life Issues

This section is primarily devoted to issues concerning euthanasia and physician-assisted suicide. There are of course other issues relevant to the end of life – for example, issues surrounding consent, often through examining the status of such things as advance directives, living wills, and DNR orders, but for space limits, we will only look at euthanasia and physician-assisted suicide. It will be very important to get a clear idea about what is meant with respect to euthanasia, suicide, and all of its various kinds. First, we can think of euthanasia as the intentional killing of another person, where the intention is to benefit that person by ending their life, and that it, in fact, does benefit their life  (McMahan, 2002). Furthermore, we can distinguish between voluntary, involuntary, and non-voluntary euthanasia. Voluntary is where the person killed consents to it. Involuntary is where the person actively expresses that they do not give their consent, or where consent was possible but where they were not asked. Non-voluntary is where consent is not possible – for example, the person is in a vegetative state. Another distinction is active versus passive euthanasia. Active euthanasia involves doing something to the person which then ends their life, for example, shooting them, or injecting them with a lethal does. Passive euthanasia involves denying assistance or treatment to the person that they would need to otherwise live. Here is an example that should illustrate the difference. Smothering a person with a pillow would be active, even if it technically denies them something they need to live – that is, oxygen. Refusing to continue a breathing device, by unplugging the person from the device, would be passive.

Suicide is the act of a person taking their own life. Most ways that we speak and think of suicide are in terms of it being non-assisted. But suppose that you have a friend who wants to end their own life, but doesn't have the financial and technical means to do it in a way that she believes is as painless and successful as possible. If you give them money and knowledge in how to end their lives in this way, then you have assisted them in their suicide. Physicians are well-placed to assist others in ending their lives. Already, one could see how the distinction between physician-assisted suicide and voluntary active euthanasia can get rather blurred. (Imagine a terminally ill person whose condition is so extreme and debilitating that the only thing they can do to take part in the ending of their life is pressing a button that injects a lethal dose, but where the entire killing device is set up, both in design and construction, by a physician. Is this assisted suicide or euthanasia?)

Although as far as I know, no surveys have been done to support the following claim, one might think that the following is plausible:  Involuntary active euthanasia is the most difficult to justify, with non-voluntary active euthanasia following, and with voluntary active euthanasia following that; then it goes involuntary passive, non-voluntary passive, and then voluntary passive euthanasia in order from most difficult to least difficult to justify. It is difficult to figure out where physician-assisted suicide and non-assisted suicide would fit in, but it's plausible to think that non-assisted suicide would be the easiest to justify, where this becomes trivially true if the issue is in terms of what a third party may permissibly do.

It appears then that, minimally, it is more difficult to justify active euthanasia than passive. Some authors, however, have contested this. James Rachels gives various reasons, but perhaps the best two are as follows. First, in some cases, active euthanasia is more humane than passive. For example, if the only way to end the life of a terminally ill person is by denying them life-supporting measures, perhaps by unplugging them from a feeding tube, where it will take weeks, if not months for them to die, then this seems less humane, and perhaps outright cruel, in comparison to just injecting them with a lethal dose. Second, Rachels thinks of the distinction between active and passive euthanasia as being based on the distinction between killing and letting die. Now, this way of basing the distinction between active and passive might be placed under scrutiny – recall that we earlier defined the distinction between actively doing something that ends one life and withholding life-assisting measures, as opposed to killing someone and merely letting them die (Rachels, 1975). But suppose that we go with Rachels in allowing the killing versus letting die distinction base the distinction between active and passive euthanasia. Then consider Rachels' example as challenging the moral power of the distinction between killing and letting die:  Case 1 – A husband decides to kill his wife, and does so by placing a lethal poison in her red wine. Case 2 – A husband decides to kill his wife, and as he is walking into the bathroom to hand her the lethal dosed glass of wine, he notices her drowning in the bathtub. In case 1, the husband kills his wife, and in case 2, he merely lets her die. Does this mean that what he's done in case 2 is less morally worse?  Perhaps we might even think that in case 2 the husband is even more morally sinister.

Although it appears to be difficult to justify, there are proponents of voluntary active euthanasia. McMahan is one such proponent who gives a rather sophisticated, incremental argument for the permissibility of voluntary active euthanasia. The argument starts with an argument that rational suicide is permissible, where rational suicide is ending one's life when one believes that one's life is not worth living, and it is the case that one's life is not worth living. Then, McMahan takes the next “increment” and discusses conditions under which we would find it permissible that a physician aid someone in their rational suicide, by perhaps assisting them in the removal of their life support system; here, physician-assisted passive suicide is permissible. But then why is assisted passive suicide permissible but assisted active suicide impermissible?  As McMahan argues, there is no overriding reason why this is the case. In fact, there is a good reason to think assisted active suicide is permissible. First, consider that often people commit suicide actively, not passively, and the idea is that they want to be able to exercise control in how their life ends. Second, because one does not want to risk a failed suicide attempt, which could result in pain, humiliation, and disfigurement, one might find that they can meet their goal of death best by the assistance of another, in particular a physician. Finally, with physician-assisted active suicide being permissible, McMahan takes the next step to the permissibility of voluntary active euthanasia. So, suppose that it is permissible for a physician to design and construct an entire system where the person ending their life needs only to press a button. If the physician presses the button, then this is no longer assisted suicide and instead active euthanasia. As McMahan urges, how can it be morally relevant who presses the button (just so long as consent and intention are the same)?  Secondly, McMahan points out that some people will be so disabled by a terminal illness that they will not be able to press the button. Because they cannot physically end their life by physician-assisted active suicide, their only remaining option would then be deemed impermissible if voluntary active euthanasia is deemed impermissible, and yet those who could end their own lives still have a “permissible option” left open and available to them. On grounds of something like fairness, there is a further feature which speaks to the permissibility of voluntary active euthanasia just so long as physician-assisted active suicide is permissible (McMahan, 2002, 458-460).

c. Research, Patients, Populations, and Access

Access to, and quality of, health care is a very real concern. A good health care system is based on a number of things, one being medicine and delivery systems based on research. But research requires, at least to some extent, the use of subjects that are human beings. As such, one can see that ethical concerns arise here. Furthermore, certain populations of people may be more vulnerable to risky research than others. As such, there is another category of moral concern. There is also a basic question concerning how to finance such health care systems. This concern will be addressed in the sixth main section of this article, social ethics and issues of justice.

First, let's start with randomized clinical trials (RCT's). RCT's are such that the participants of such studies don't know whether they are obtaining the promising (but not yet certified) treatment for their condition. Informed consent is usually obtained and assumed in addressing the ethicality of RCT's. Notice, though, that if the promising treatment is life-saving, and the standard treatment received by the control group is inadequate, then there is a basis for criticism of RCT's. The idea here is that those who are in the control group could have been given the experimental, promising, and successful treatment, thereby most likely successfully treating their condition, and in the case of terminal diseases, saving their lives. Opponents of RCT's can characterize RCT's in these cases as condemning someone to death, arbitrarily, as those in the experimental group had a much higher likelihood of living/being treated. Proponents of RCT's have at least two ways of responding. They could first appeal to the modified kind of RCT's designed by Zelen. Here, those in the control group have knowledge of being in the group; they can opt out, given their knowledge of being assigned to the control group. A second, and more addressing, way of responding is by acknowledging that there is an apparent unfairness in RCT's, but then one would say that in order to garner scientifically valid results, RCT's must be used. Given that scientifically valid results here have large social benefits, the practice of using them is justified. Furthermore, those who are in control groups are not made worse off than they would be otherwise. If the only way to even have access to such “beneficial” promising, experimental treatments is through RCT's, then those assigned to control groups have not been made worse off – they haven't been harmed (For interesting discussions see Hellman and Hellman, 1991 and Marquis, 1999).

Another case (affecting large numbers of people) is this:  Certain medications can be tested on a certain population of people and yet benefit those outside the population used for testing. So, take a certain medication that can reverse HIV transmission to fetuses from mothers. This medication needs to be tested. If you go to an underdeveloped country in Africa to test it, then what kinds of obligations does the pharmaceutical company have to those participating in the study and those at large in the country upon making it available to those in developed nations like the U.S?  If availability to those in the research country is not feasible, is it permissible in the first place to conduct the study?  These are just some of the questions that arise in the production of pharmaceutical and medical services in a global context. (See Glantz, et. al., 1998 and Brody, 2002)

4. Moral Standing and Personhood

a. Theories of Moral Standing and Personhood

Take two beings, a rock and a human being. What is it about each such that it's morally okay to destroy the rock in the process of procuring minerals but not okay to destroy a human being in the process of procuring an organ for transplantation?  This question delves into the issue of moral standing. To give an answer to this question is to give a theory of moral standing/personhood. First, some technical things should be said. Any given entity/being has a moral status. Those beings that can't be morally wronged have the moral status of having no (that is, zero) moral standing. Those beings that can be morally wronged have the moral status of having some moral standing. And those beings that have the fullest moral standing are persons. Intuitively, most, if not all human beings, are persons. And intuitively, an alien species of a kind of intelligence as great as ours are persons. This leaves open the possibility that certain beings, which we would not currently know exist, could be greater in moral standing than persons. For example, if there were a god, then it seems that such a being would have greater moral standing than us, than persons; this would have us reexamine the idea that persons have the fullest moral standing. Perhaps, we could say that a god or gods were super-persons, with super moral standing.

Why is the question of moral standing important?  Primarily, the question is important in the case of non-human animals and in the case of fetuses. For this article, we will only focus on human animals directly. But before considering animals, let's take a look at some various theories of what constitutes moral standing for a being. A first shot is the idea that being a human being is necessary and sufficient for being something with moral standing. Notice that according to this theory/definition, rocks are excluded, which is a good thing. But then this runs into the problem of excluding all non-human animals, even for example, primates like chimps and bonobos. As such, the next theory motivated would be this:  A being/entity has moral standing (moral counts/can be morally wronged) if and only if it is living. But according to this theory, things like plants and viruses can be morally wronged. A virus has to be considered in our moral deliberations in considering whether or not to treat a disease, and because the viral entities have moral standing; well, this is counterintuitive, and indicates that with this theory, there is a problem of being too inclusive. So, another theory to consider is one which excludes plants, viruses, and bacteria. This theory would be rationality. According to this theory, those who morally count would have rationality. But there are problems. Does a mouse possess rationality?  But even if one is comfortable with mice not having rationality, and thereby not counting morally, one might then have a problem with certain human beings who lack genuinely rational capacities. As such, another way to go is the theory of souls. One might say that what morally counts is what has a soul; certain human beings might lack rationality, but they at least have a soul. What's problematic with this theory of moral standing is that it posits an untestable/unobservable entity – namely, a soul. What prohibits a virus, or even a rock, from having a soul?  Notice that this objection to the soul theory of moral standing does not deny the existence of souls. Instead, it is that such a theory posits the existence of an entity that is not observable, and which there cannot be a test for its existence.

Another theory, which is not necessarily true and which is not unanimously accepted as true, is the sentience theory of moral standing. According to this theory, what gives something moral standing is that it is something that is sentient – that is, it is something that has experiences, and more specifically has experiences of pain and pleasure. With this theory, rocks and plants don't have moral standing; mice and men do. One problem, though, is that many of us think that there is a moral difference between mice and men. According to this theory, there is no way to explain how although mice have moral standing, human beings are persons (Andrews, 1996). It appears that to do this, one would have to appeal to rationality/intelligence. But as discussed, there are problems with this. Finally, there is another theory, intimately tied with sentience theory. We can safely say that most beings who experience pain and pleasure have an interest in the kinds of experiences that they have. There is, however, the possibility that there are beings who experience pain and pleasure but who don't care about their experiences. So what should we say about those who care about their experiences?  Perhaps it is not their experiences that matter, but the fact that they care about their experiences. In that case, it looks like what matters morally is their caring about their experiences. As such, we should call this new theory “interest theory.”  A being/entity has moral standing if and only if it has interests (in virtue of caring about the experiences it has).

b. The Moral Status of Non-Human Animals

In the literature, though, how are non-human animals considered?  Are they considered as having moral standing?  Peter Singer is probably one of the first to advocate, in the academic literature, for animals as having moral standing. Very importantly, he documented how current agrarian practices treated animals, from chimps to cows to chickens (Singer, 1975). The findings were astonishing. Many people would find the conditions under which these animals are treated despicable and morally wrong. A question arises, though, concerning what the basis is for moral condemnation of the treatment of such animals. Singer, being a utilitarian, could be characterized as saying that treating such animals in the documented ways does not maximize overall goodness/utility. It appears, though, that he appeals to another principle, which can be called the principle of equitable treatment. It goes:  It is morally permissible to treat two different beings differently only if there is some moral difference between the two which justifies the differential treatment (Singer, 1975). So, is there a moral difference between human beings and cows such that the killing of human beings for food is wrong but the killing of cows is not?  According to Singer, there is not. However, we could imagine a difference between the two, and perhaps there is.

Another theorist in favor of non-human animals is Tom Regan. He argues that non-human animals, at least of a certain kind, have moral rights just as human animals do. As such, there are no utilitarian grounds which could justify using non-human animals in a way different than human animals. To be more careful, though, we could imagine a situation in which treating a human a certain way violates her rights but the same treatment does not violate a non-human's rights. Regan supports this possibility (Regan, 1983). This does not change the fact that non-humans and humans equally have rights, but just that the content of rights will depend on their nature. Finally, we should note that there are certain rights-theorists who, in virtue of their adherence to rights theory, will say that non-human animals do not have rights. As such, they do not have moral standing, or at least a robust enough moral standing in which we should consider them in our moral deliberations as beings that morally count (Cohen, 1986).

5. Professional Ethics

a. What is a Profession?

Certain things like law, medicine, and engineering are considered to be professions. Other things like unskilled labor and art are not. There are various ways to try to understand what constitutes something as a profession. For the purposes of this article, there will be no discussion of necessary and jointly sufficient conditions proposed for something constituting a profession. With that said, some proposed general characteristics will be discussed. We will discuss these characteristics in terms of a controversial case, the case of journalism. Is journalism a profession?  Generally, there are certain financial benefits enjoyed by professions such as law, medicine, and engineering. As such, we can see that there may be a financial motivation on the part of some journalists to consider it to be a profession. Additionally, one can be insulated from criticism by being part of a profession; one could appeal to some kind of professional authority against the layperson (or someone outside that profession) (Merrill, 1974). One could point out, though, that just because some group desires to be some x does not mean that they are x (a basic philosophical point). One way to respond to this is that the law, medicine, and engineering have a certain esteem attached to them. If journalists could create that same esteem, then perhaps they could be regarded as professions.

But as Merrill points out, journalism seems to lack certain important characteristics shared by the professions. With the professional exemplars already mentioned, one has to usually take a series of professional exams. These exams test a number of things, one of them being the jargon of the profession. Usually, one is educated specifically for a certain profession, often with terminal degrees for that profession. Although there are journalism schools, entry into the practice of journalism does not require education in a journalism school, nor does it require anything like the testing involved in, say, the law. Furthermore, there is usually a codified set of principles or rules, even if rather vague and ambiguous, which apply to professionals. Perhaps journalists can appeal to such mottos as tell the truth, cite your sources, protect your sources, and be objective. But in addition to the almost emptiness of these motto's, there is the problem that under interpretation, there is plenty of disagreement about whether they are valid principles in the first place. For example, if one wants to go with a more literal appeal to truth telling, then how are we to think of the gonzo journalism of Hunter Thomson?  Or with documentary making, there are some who believe that the documentarian should stay objective by not placing themselves in the documentary or by not assisting subjects. Notice here that although journalism may not be a profession, there are still ethical issues involved, ones that journalists should be mindful of. Therefore, even if journalism cannot be codified and organized into something that counts as a profession, this does not mean that there are not important ethical issues involved in doing one's work. This should be no surprise, as ethical issues are abundant in life and work. 

b. Engineering Ethics

In this section, we will discuss engineering ethics for two purposes. One purpose is to use engineering ethics as a case study in professional ethics. More importantly, the second purpose is to give the reader some idea of some of the ethical issues involved in engineering as a practice.

One way to approach engineering ethics is by first thinking of it as a profession, and then given its features as a profession, examine ethical issues according to those features. So, for example, given that professions usually have a codified set of principles or rules for their professionals, one could try to articulate, expand, and flesh out such principles. Another way to approach engineering ethics is by starting with particular cases, usually of the historical as opposed to the hypothetical kind, and then draw out any moral lessons and perhaps principles from there. Accordingly, one would start with such cases as the Hyatt-Regency Walkway Collapse, the Challenger Space Shuttle Accident, and the Chernobyl and Bhopal Plant Accidents, just to name a few(Martin and Schinzinger, 2005).

The Challenger Space Shuttle Accident brings up a number of ethical issues, but one worth discussing is the role of engineer/manager. When one is both an engineer and also in upper or middle-level management, and when one has the responsibility as an engineer to report safety problems with a design but also has the pressure of project completion being a manager, (i) does one role trump the other in determining appropriate courses of action, and if so which one?; (ii) or are the two reconcilable in such a way that there really is no conflict?; (iii) or are the two irreconcilable such that inevitably assigning people to an engineer/manager role will lead to moral problems?

One philosophically interesting issue that is brought up by engineering is the assessment of safety and risk. What constitutes something being safe?  And what constitutes something being a risk?  Tversky and Kahneman (Tversky and Kahneman, 1981) famously showed that in certain cases, where risk-assessment is made, most people will prefer one option over another even when the expected value of both options are identical. What could explain this?  One explanation appeals to the idea that people are able to appropriately think about risk in a way that is not capturable by standard risk-cost-benefit analyses. Another explanation is that most people are in error and that their basing one preference over another is founded on an illusion concerning risk. With either interpretation/explanation determining risk is important, and understanding risk is then important in determining the safety of a product/design option. It is of great ethical concern that engineers be concerned with producing safe products, and thereby identifying and assessing properly the risks of such products.

There are also concerns with respect to what kinds of projects engineers should participate in. Should they participate in the development of weaponry?  If so, what kind of weapon production is morally permissible?  Furthermore, to what extent should engineers be concerned with the environment in proposing products and their designs?  Should engineers as professionals work to make products that are demanded by the market?  If there are competing claims to a service/product that cannot be explained in terms of market demand, then to what extent do engineers have a responsibility to their corporate employers, if their corporate employers require production design for things that run counter to what's demanded by those “outside of” the market?  Let us be concrete with an unfortunately hypothetical example. Suppose you have a corporation called GlobalCyber Initiatives, with the motto: making the world globally connected from the ground up. And suppose that your company has a contract in a country with limited cell towers. Wealthy business owners of that country complain that their middle-level manager would like a processing upgrade to their hand-held devices so that they can access more quickly the cell towers (which are conveniently placed next to factories). Your company could provide that upgrade. But you, as lead in R&D, have been working on instead providing upgrades to PC's, so that these PC's can be used in remote, rural areas that have no/limited access to cell towers. With your upgrade, PC's could be sold to the country in question for use in local libraries. The contract with the business owners would be more lucrative (slightly) but a contract with that country's government, which is willing to participate, would do much more good for that country, at both the overall level, and also specifically for the very many people throughout the very rural country. What should you do as lead of the R&D?  How far should you be concerned?  How far should you be pushy in making the government contract come about?  Or should you not be concerned at all?

These questions are supposed to highlight how engineering ethics thought of merely as an ethic of how to be a good employee is perhaps too limiting, and how engineering as a profession might have a responsibility to grapple with what the purposes of it, as a profession, are supposed to be. As such, this then highlights how framing the purposes of a profession is inherently ethical, insofar as professions are to be responsive to the values of those that they serve.

6. Social Ethics, Distributive Justice, and Environmental Ethics

This section is an oddity, but due to space limitations, is the best way to structure an article like this. First of all, take something like “social ethics”. In some sense, all ethics is social, as it deals with human beings and other social creatures. Nevertheless, some people think that certain moral issues apply only to our private lives while we are behind closed doors. For example, is masturbation morally wrong?  Or, is homosexual sex morally wrong?   One way such questions are viewed is that, in a sense, they are not simple private questions, but inherently social. For example with homosexual sex, since sex is also a public phenomenon in some way, and sense the expression of sexual orientation is certainly public, there is definitely a way of understanding even this issue as public and therefore social. Perhaps the main point that needs to be emphasized is that when I say social I mean those issues that need to be understood obviously in a public, social way, and which cannot be easily subsumed under one of the other sub-disciplines discussed above.

Another reason this section is an oddity is that the topic of distributive justice is often thought of as one properly falling within the discipline of political philosophy, and not applied ethics. One of various reasons for including a section on it is that often distributive justice is talked about directly and indirectly in business ethics courses, as well as in courses discussing the allocation of health care resources (which may be included in a bioethics course). Another reason for inclusion is that famine relief is an applied ethical topic, and distributive justice, in a global context, obviously relates to famine relief. Finally, this section is an oddity because here environmental ethics only gets a subsection of this encyclopedia article and not an entire section, like equally important fields like bioethics or business ethics. The justification, though, for this is (i) space limitations and (ii) that various important moral considerations involving the environment are discussed within the context of bioethics, business ethics, and moral standing.

a. Social Ethics

To start with, perhaps some not-as-controversial (compared to earlier times) topics that fall within social ethics are affirmative action and smoking bans. The discussions involved with these topics are rich in discussion of such moral notions as fairness, benefits, appropriation of scarce resources, liberty, property rights, paternalism, and consent.

Other issues have to do with appropriating the still very real gender differences in wealth, responsibilities, social roles, and employment opportunities. How are these differences to be understood?  Obviously not because such differences are deserved. Given this, such differences need to either be morally justified (doubtful) or morally rectified, and so, if they can't be justified, then such differences should be morally eliminated/rectified. Very good work can be done on understanding how to do this in a way that does not create further moral problems. Additionally, work on the visibility of transgendered persons is important, and how transgendered persons can be incorporated into the modern life of working in corporations, government, education, or industry, living in predominantly non-transgendered communities and networks of families with more typical gender narratives, and doing this all in a way that respects the personhood of transgendered persons.

b. Distributive Justice, and Famine Relief

The term distributive justice is misleading in so far as justice is usually thought in terms of punitive justice. Punitive justice deals with determining the guilt or innocence of actions on the part of defendants, as well as just punishments of those found guilty of crimes. Distributive justice on the other hand deals with something related but yet much different. Take a society, or group of societies, and consider a limited number of resources, goods, and services. The question arises about how those resources, goods, and services should be distributed across individuals of such societies. Furthermore, there is the question about what kind of organization, or centralizing power, should be set up to deal with distribution of such goods (short for goods, resources, and services); let's call such organizations which centralize power governments.

In this subsection, we will examine some very simplified characterizations to the question of distribution of goods, and subsequent questions of government. We will first cover a rather generic list of positions on distributive justice and government, and then proceed to a discussion of distributive justice and famine relief. Finally, we will discuss a number of more contemporary approaches to distributive justice, leaving it open to how each of these approaches would handle the issue of famine relief.

Anarchism is a position in which no such government is justified. As such, there is no centralizing power that distributes goods. Libertarianism is the position that says that government is justified in so far as it is a centralizing power used to enforce taxation for the purpose of enforcing person's property rights. This kind of theory of distributive justice emphasizes a minimal form of government for the purpose of protecting and enforcing the rights of individuals to their property. Any kind of theory that advocates any further kind of government for purposes other than enforcement of property rights might be called socialist, but to be more informative, it will help to distinguish between at least three theories of distributive justice that might be called socialist. First, we might have those who care about equality. Egalitarian theories will emphasize that government exists to enforce taxation to redistribute wealth to make things as equal as possible between people in terms of their well-being. Bare-minimum theories will instead specify some bare minimum needed for any citizen/individual to minimally do well (perhaps have a life worth living). Government is then to specify policies, usually through taxation, in order to make sure that the bare minimum is met for all. Finally, we have meritocracy theories, and in theory, these may not count as socialist. The reason for this is that we could imagine a society in which there are people that do not merit the help which would be given to them through redistributive taxation. In another sense, however, it is socialist in that we can easily imagine societies where there are people who merit a certain amount of goods, and yet do not have them, and such people, according to the theory of merit, would be entitled to goods through taxation on others.

The debate concerning theories of distributive justice is easily in the 10's of thousands of pages.  Instead of going into the debates, we should, for the purpose of applied ethics, go on to how distributive justice applies to famine relief, easily something within applied ethics. Peter Singer takes a position on famine relief in which it is morally required of those in developed nations to assist those experiencing famine (usually in underdeveloped nations)  (Singer, 1999). If we take such theories of distributive justice as applying across borders, then it is rather apparent that Singer rejects the libertarian paradigm, whereby taxation is not justified for anything other than protection of property rights. Singer instead is a utilitarian, where his justification has to do with producing overall goodness. Libertarians on the other hand will allow for the justice of actions and polices which do not produce the most overall goodness. It is not quite clear what socialist position Singer takes, but no matter.. It is obvious that he argues from a perspective that is not libertarian. In fact, he uses an example from Peter Unger to make his point, which is obviously not libertarian. The example (modified):  Imagine someone who has invested some of her wealth in some object (a car, for example) that is then the only thing that can prevent some innocent person from dying; the object will be destroyed in saving their life. Suppose that the person decides not to allow her object from being destroyed, thereby allowing the other (innocent) person to die. Has the object (car) owner done something wrong?  Intuitively, yes. Well, as Singer points out, so has anyone in the developed world, with enough money, in not giving to those experiencing famine relief; they have let those suffering people die. One such response is libertarian, Jan Narveson being an exemplar here (Narveson, 1993). Here, we have to make a difference between charity and justice. According to Narveson, it would be charitable (and a morally good thing) for one to give up some of one's wealth or the saving object, but doing so is not required by justice. Libertarians in general have even more sophisticated responses to Singer, but that will not concern us here, as it can be seen how there is a disagreement on something important like famine relief, based on differences in political principles, or theories of distributive justice.

As discussed earlier in this subsection, libertarian theories were contrasted with socialist positions, where socialist is not to be confused with how it is used in the rhetoric of most media. The earliest of the influential socialist theories is proposed by John Rawls (Rawls, 1971).  Rawls is more properly an egalitarian theorist, who does allow for inequalities just so far as they improve the least-advantaged in the best possible way, and in a way that does not compromise basic civil liberties. There have been reactions to his views, though. For example, his Harvard colleague, Robert Nozick, takes a libertarian perspective, where he argues that the kinds of distributive policies endorsed by Rawls infringe on basic rights (and entitlements) of persons – basically, equality, as Rawls visions, encroaches on liberty (Nozick, 1974). On the other end of the spectrum, there are those like Kai Nielson who argue that Rawls does not go far enough. Basically, the equality Rawls argues for, according to Nielson, will still allow for too much inequality, where many perhaps will be left without the basic things needed to be treated equally and to have basic equal opportunities. For other post-Rawlsian critiques and general theories, consult the works of Michael Sandel, Martha Nussbaum (a student of Rawls), Thomas Pogge (a student of Rawls), and Michael Boylan. 

c. Environmental Ethics

This subsection will be very brief, as some of the issues have already been discussed. Some things, however, should be said about how environmental ethics can be understood in a way that is foundational, independent of business ethics, bioethics, and engineering ethics.

First of all, there is the question of what status the environment has independent of human beings. Does the environment have value if human beings do not exist, and would never exist?   There are actually some who give the answer yes, and not just because there would be other sentient beings. Suppose, then, that we have an environment with no sentient beings, and which will never progress into having sentient beings. Does such an environment still matter?  Yes, according to some. But even if an environment matters in the context of either actual or potential sentient beings, there are those who defend such an idea, but do so without thinking that primarily what matters is sentient beings.

Another way to categorize positions concerning the status of the environment is by differentiating those who advocate anthropocentrism from those who advocate a non-anthropocentric position. This debate is not merely semantic, nor is it merely academic, nor is it something trivial. It's a question of value, and the role of human beings in helping or destroying things of (perhaps) value, independent of the status of human beings having value. To be more concrete, suppose that the environment of the Earth had intrinsic value, and value independently of human beings. Suppose then that human beings, as a collective, destroyed not only themselves but the Earth. Then, by almost definition, they have destroyed something of intrinsic value. Those who care about things with value, especially intrinsic value, should be rather concerned about this possibility (Here, consult: Keller, 2010; Elliot, 1996; Rolston, 2012; Callicot, 1994).

Many moral issues concerning the environment, though, can be seriously considered going with the two above options – that is, whether or not the environment (under which humans exist) matter if human beings do not exist. Even if one does not consider one of the two above options, it is hard to deny that the environment morally matters in a serious way. Perhaps such ways to consider the importance is through the study of how business and engineering affects the environment.

7. Theory and Application

One might still worry about the status of applied ethics for the reason that it is not quite clear what the methodology/formula is for determining the permissibility of any given action/practice. Such a worry is justified, indeed. The reason for the justification of skepticism here is that there are multiple approaches to determining the permissibility of actions/practices.

One such approach is very much top-down. The approach starts with a normative theory, where actions are determined by a single principle dictating the permissibility/impermissibility (rightness/wrongness) of actions/practices. The idea is that you start with something like utilitarianism (permissible just in case it maximizes overall goodness), Kantianism (permissible just in case it does not violate imperatives of rationality or respecting persons), or virtue theory (permissible just in case it abides with what the ideally virtuous person would do). From there, you get results of permissibility or impermissibility (rightness/wrongness).

Although each of these theories have important things to say about applied ethical issues, one might complain about them due to various reasons. Take utilitarianism, for example. It, as a theory, implies certain things morally required that many take to be wrong, or not required (for example, lynching an innocent person to please a mob, or spending ten years after medical school in a 3rd world country). There are also problems for the other two main kinds of theories, as well, such that one might be skeptical about a top-down approach that uses such theories to apply to applied ethical cases.

Another approach is to use a pluralist kind of ethical theory. Such a pluralist theory is comprised of various moral principles. Each of the principles might be justified by utilitarian, Kantian, or virtue theories. Or they may not. The idea here is that there are multiple principles to draw from to determine to the rightness/wrongness of any given action/practice within the applied ethical world. Such an approach sounds more than reasonable until another approach is considered, which will be discussed below.

What if, though, it was the case that some moral feature, of a purported moral principle, worked in such a way that it counted for the permissibility of an action in one case, case1, but counted against the permissibility of the same action in another case, case 2?  What should we say here?  An example would be helpful. Suppose that Jon has to hit Candy to get candy. Suppose that this counts as a morally good thing. Then the very same Jon hitting of Candy to get candy in a different contest could be a morally bad thing. This example is supposed to highlight the third theoretical possibility of moral particularism (Dancy, 1993).

To sum things up for applied ethics, it very much matters what theoretical approach one takes. Does one take the top-down approach of going with a normative/ethical theory to apply to specific actions/practices?  Or does one go with a pluralist approach?  Or does one go with a particularistic approach that requires, essentially, examining things case by case?

Finally, some things concerning moral psychology should be discussed. Moral psychology deals with understanding how we should appropriate actual moral judgments, of actual moral agents, in light of the very real contexts under which are made. Additionally, moral psychology tries to understand the limits of actions of human beings in relation to their environment, the context under which they act and live. (Notice that according to this definition, multicultural relativity of practices and actions has to be accounted for, as the differences in actions/practices might be due to differences in environments.)  Experiments from social psychology confirm the idea that how people behave is determined by their environment; for example, we have the Milgrim Experiment and the Stanford Prison Experiment. We might not expect people to act in such gruesome ways, but according to such experiments, if you place them in certain conditions, this will provoke ugly responses. Two reasons that these findings are important for applied ethics is:  (i) if you place persons in these conditions, you get non-ideal moral results, and (ii) our judgments about what to morally avoid/prevent are misguided because we don't keep in mind the findings of such experiments. If we kept in mind the fragility of human behavior relative to conditions/environment, we might try get closer to eradicating such conditions/environments, and subsequent bad results.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Allhoff, Fritz, and Vaidya, Anand J. “Business in Ethical Focus”. (2008), Broadview.
  • Andrews, Kristei. “The First Step in Case for Great Ape Equality: The Argument for Other Minds.”  (1996), Etica and Animali.
  • Beauchamp, Tom, and Bowie, Norman. “Ethical Theory and Business.”  (1983), Prentice-Hall.
  • Boylan, Michael. “A Just Society.” (2004), Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Boylan, Michael. “Morality and Global Justice: Justifications and Applications.”  (2011), Westview.
  • Boylan, Michael   “Morality and Global Justice:  Reader.”  (2011), Westview.
  • Brody, Baruch. “Ethical Issues in Clinical Trials in Developing Countries.”  (2002) (vol. 2), Statistics in Medicine. (2002), John Wiley & Sons.
  • Callahan, Joan. “Ethical Issues in Professional Life.”  (1988), Oxford.
  • Callicott, J. Baird. “Earth's Insights.”  (1994), University of California Press.
  • Carr, Albert Z. “Is Business Bluffing Ethical?” (1968), Harvard Business Review.
  • Chadwick, Ruth; Kuhse, Helga; Landman, Willem; Schuklenk, Udo; Singer, Peter. “The Bioethics Reader: Editor's Choice.”  (2007), Blackwell.
  • Cohen, Carl. “The Case for the Use of Animals in Biomedical Research.”  (1986), New England Journal of Medicine.
  • Danley, John. “Corporate Moral Agency: The Case for Anthropological Bigotry”. (1980), Action and Responsibility: Bowling Green Studies in Applied Philosophy, vol. 2.
  • Elliot, Robert. “Environmental Ethics.”  (1996), Oxford.
  • Freeman, R. Edward. “A Stakeholder Theory of the Modern Corporation.”  (1994)
  • French, Peter. “Corporations as a Moral Person.”  (1979), American Philosophical Quarterly.
  • Friedman, Milton. “The Social Responsibility of Corporations is to Increase its Profits.”  (1970), New York Times Magazine.
  • Glantz, Leonard; Annas, George J;  Grodin, Michael A; “Mariner, Wendy K. Research in Developing Countries: Taking Benefit Seriously.”  (1998), Hastings Center Report.
  • Hellman, Samuel; Hellman, Deborah S. “Of Mice But Not Men:  Problems of the Randomized Clinical Trial.”  (1991), The New England Journal of Medicine.
  • Holm, Soren. “Going to the Roots of the Stem Cell Controversy.”  In The Bioethics Reader, Chawick, et. al. (2007), Blackwell.
  • Hursthouse, Rosalind. “Virtue Theory and Abortion.”  (1991), Philosophy & Public Affairs.
  • LaFollte, Hugh. “The Oxford Handbood of Practical Ethics.” (2003), Oxford.
  • Kamm, Francis M. “Creation and Abortion.” (1996), Oxford.
  • Keller, David R. “Environmental Ethics: The Big Questions.”  (2010), Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Mappes, Thomas, and Degrazzia, David. “Biomedical Ethics.”  6Th ed. (2006), McGraw-Hill.
  • Marquis, Don. “How to Resolve an Ethical Dilemma Concerning Randomized Clinical Trials”. (1999), New England Journal of Medicine.
  • Martin, Mike W; Schinzinger, Roland. “Ethics in Engineering.”  4Th ed. (2005), McGraw-Hill.
  • McMahan, Jeff. “The Ethics of Killing.”  (2002), Oxford.
  • Narveson, Jan. “Moral Matters.”  (1993), Broadview Press.
  • Nielsen, Kai. “Radical Egalitarian Justice: Justice as Equality.”  Social Theory and Practice, (1979).
  • Nozick, Robert. “Anarchy, State, and Utopia.”  (1974), Basic Books.
  • Nussbaum, Martha C. “Sex and Social Justice.”  (1999), New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Pogge, Thomas W. “An Egalitarian Law of Peoples.” Philosophy and Public Affairs, (1994)
  • Pojman, Louis P; Pojman, Paul. “Environmental Ethics.”  6Th ed. (2011), Cengage.
  • Prinz, Jesse. “The Emotional Construction of Morals.”  (2007), Oxford.
  • Rachels, James. “Ethical Theory 1: The Question of Objectivity.”  (1998), Oxford.
  • Rachels, James. Ethical Theory 2:  “Theories about How We Should Live”. (1998) , Oxford.
  • Rachels, James. “The Elements of Moral Philosophy.”  McGraw Hill.
  • Rachels, James. “The Right Thing to Do.”  McGraw Hill.
  • Rachels, James. “Passive and Active Euthanasia.”  1975, Journal of New England Medicine.
  • Rawls, John. “A Theory of Justice.”  (1971), Harvard.
  • Roston III, Holmes. “A New Environmental Ethics.”  (2012), Routledge.
  • Sandel, Michael J. “Liberalism and the Limits of Justice.”  (1982), New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Singer, Peter. “Practical Ethics.”  (1979), Oxford.
  • Singer, Peter. “Animal Liberation.”  (1975), Oxford.
  • Shaw, William H. “Business Ethics: A Textbook with Cases.”  (2011), Wadsworth.
  • Thomson, J.J. “In Defense of Abortion.” (1971), Philosophy & Public Affairs.
  • Unger, Peter. “Living High and Letting Die.”  (1996), Oxford.


Author Information

Joel Dittmer
Missouri University of Science and Technology
U. S. A.


An apology is the act of declaring one’s regret, remorse, or sorrow for having insulted, failed, injured, harmed or wronged another. Some apologies are interpersonal (between individuals, that is, between friends, family members, colleagues, lovers, neighbours, or strangers). Other apologies are collective (by one group to another group or by a group to an individual). More generally, apologies can be offered “one to one,” “one to many,” “many to one,” or “many to many.”

While the practice of apologizing is nothing new, the end of the twentieth century and the beginning of the twenty-first witnessed a sharp rise in the number of public and political apologies, so much so that some scholars believe we are living in an “age of apology” (Gibney et al. 2006) or within a “culture of apology” (Mills 2001). A gesture formerly considered a sign of weakness has grown to represent moral strength and a crucial step towards potential reconciliation. Individuals, but more often states, churches, the judiciary, the medical profession and universities publicly issue apologies to those they have wronged in the past. Crimes ranging from personal betrayals and insults all the way to enslavement, violations of medical ethics, land displacement, violations of treaties or international law, systemic discrimination, wartime casualties, cultural disruptions, or political seizures constitute reasons for public expressions of regret.

What apologies are, and which goals they can promote, are objects of inquiry for a number of academic disciplines in the social sciences and humanities, including philosophy, political science, theology, psychology, history and sociology. Authors have been preoccupied by an array of questions: What are the validity conditions for an apology? Are these the same for interpersonal and collective apologies? And what purposes do apologies serve in human societies?

Table of Contents

  1. Interpersonal Apologies (“One to One”)
    1. Types
    2. Validity Conditions
    3. The Goals of the Interpersonal Apology
  2. The “One to Many” Apology
    1. Types
    2. Validity Conditions
    3. The Goals of the “One to Many” Apology
  3. Collective Apology (“Many to Many” or “Many to One”)
    1. Types
    2. Validity Conditions
    3. The Goals of the Collective Apology
    4. Scepticism about Collective Apologies
  4. Theatricality and Non-verbal Apologies
  5. Intercultural Apologies
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Interpersonal Apologies (“One to One”)

a. Types

In interpersonal apologies, an individual acknowledges and promises to redress offences committed against another individual. Such an apology can be performed in private (for instance, when one family member apologizes to another within the walls of their common abode) or in public (when individuals with public profiles apologise to their spouses, friends or colleagues for their blunders in a highly mediated fashion). Although, in a broad sense, everything is political, interpersonal apologies can be political in the stricter sense when the offender and the offended are politicians, public officials or representatives of political organizations. Clear examples of interpersonal political apologies are Senator Fred Thompson’s apology to Bill Clinton for insinuating that the latter had been involved in corruption or the apology by Republican House Majority Leader Dick Armey for referring to Representative Barney Frank, a Democrat representing Massachusetts, as “Barney Fag.”

b. Validity Conditions

In order to count as valid, an apology must meet a number of conditions. While there is great variation among authors on the number and exact role that different elements play within an apology, there is a growing consensus that an authentic apology implies: an acknowledgement that the incident in question did in fact occur and that it was inappropriate; a recognition of responsibility for the act; the expression of an attitude of regret and a feeling of remorse; and the declaration of an intention to refrain from similar acts in the future.

Authors dealing with the interpersonal apology position themselves on a continuum, ranging from rather lax to very stringent requirements that an apology must meet in order to be valid. Nick Smith provides us with the theoretically most systematic and normatively strictest account of the interpersonal apology, listing no less than twelve conditions for what he calls a valid “categorical” apology: a corroborated factual record, the acceptance of blame (to be distinguished from expressions of sympathy as in “I am sorry for your loss”), having standing (only those causally responsible for the offence can apologise), identification of each harm separately, identification of the moral principles underlying each harm, endorsement of the moral principles underlying each harm, recognition of the victim as a moral interlocutor, categorical regret (recognition of the fact that one’s act constitute a moral failure), the performance of the apology, reform and redress (post-apology), sincere intentions (lying when apologizing would only double the insult to the victim), and some expression of emotion (sorrow, guilt, empathy, sympathy) (Smith 2008). To the extent that an interpersonal apology fails on any of these criteria, it fails to achieve the status of a proper apology.

Whether one has a more lax or a more strict understanding of the validity conditions for the interpersonal apology, the offended individual has the standing to accept or reject the apology.

c. The Goals of the Interpersonal Apology

Normatively, interpersonal apologies are meant to recognise the equal moral worth of the victim. While the offence cannot be undone, the act of acknowledging it recognises the offended as an equal moral agent. Psychologically, an apology aims to meet the victim’s psychological needs of recognition, thus restoring her self-respect (Lazare 2004). Diminishing her desire for revenge, healing humiliations, and facilitating reconciliation are hoped for, but empirically contingent, effects of the apology. A cathartic effect on the guilty conscience of the offender is one other psychologically desirable consequence of a successful apology.

If the apology is accepted and if the offender is forgiven, the moral status quo ante (of equal moral worth of the offending and the offended parties) will be restored. However, forgiveness follows the apology only when the victim undergoes a deep psychological change: when she gives up her moral anger and the desire for revenge. Forgiveness should not be confused with forgetting, which is involuntary and does not presuppose a “change of heart.” While possible, forgiveness is neither necessary nor a right that the offender can claim once she has apologized and shown remorse. Forgiveness remains the privilege of the offended. In addition and contrary to some religious traditions, philosophers have usually argued that forgiveness should not be understood as the victim’s duty, nor should it be conceived of as a test of her good character.

2. The “One to Many” Apology

a. Types

The “one to many” apology can be either private or public, and can be political or non-political. For example, when one individual apologizes privately to her family, group of friends, neighbours, or colleagues for an insult or any other moral failure, we are talking about a non-political “one to many” apology. Public figures sometimes choose to communicate their regret via mass media, and then the apology is public and non-political. For example, actress Morgan James apologized to the cast and crew of the Sondheim musical “Into the Woods” for disproportionally criticising the New York production using language that was too strong. On the contrary, when a politician or official apologizes to her party, her voters or the nation for a wrong, we are dealing with a political public “one to many” apology. Kaing Guek Eav’s (a.k.a. “Duch”) apologizing to the Cambodian people for his actions in the S21 prison or Richard Nixon apologizing to his supporters and voters for the Watergate scandal are just two among many examples of “one to many” public political apologies.

b. Validity Conditions

When an individual apologizes to her family, to her group of friends, or to the nation, we apply the same standards of validity that we apply to interpersonal apologies. Minimally, an apology by one to the many must include an acknowledgement that a wrong has been committed, acceptance of responsibility, a promise of forbearance, expression of regret or remorse and an offer of repair. She who has committed the wrong has the proper standing to apologize.

Things get complicated when we consider who accepts the apology. The size of the group is an important variable. A family or a group of friends can come together and decide what to do in response to the apology. A corporation or a village can organize a consultative process and determine how to react. In fact, under the banner of “restorative justice”, an entire literature addresses the ways in which communities can heal broken relations and re-integrate those among their members who have gone astray (Braithwaite 1989). But how do large, unorganized groups, such as nations, accept an apology? Many critics of restorative justice have pointed out that such a conception of justice does not make much sense outside small, closely knit communities. Can there ever be consensus about how to deal with officials’ expressions of regret within the large, pluralistic publics of today’s societies? Elections and opinion polls are probably the only – imperfect – mechanisms for gaining insight into whether an apology has or has not been accepted by the members of the polity. While a great deal of attention has been paid to the normative pre-requisites of a valid apology, there are no systematic studies regarding their effect on the public culture of the societies in which they are offered. This is an important lacuna in great need of remedy.

c. The Goals of the “One to Many” Apology

The purposes of the non-political “one to many” apology overlap with those of the interpersonal acts of contrition: recognizing the victims as moral interlocutors and communicating the fact that the offender understands and regrets the violation of their legitimate moral expectations, thus making a first step towards a desired reconciliation.

Beside the acknowledgement and recognition functions of the political variety of the “one to many” apology, such acts also seek to satisfy the publicity requirement and set the record straight, re-affirm the principles the community abides by and, in giving an account of one’s personal failures as a politician or representative, they individualize guilt. Strategically, such acts may be employed to minimize political losses, save one’s political career and, if that were not possible, to insulate one’s office or party from the negative consequences of a particular person’s misdeeds. It may also be used to increase the chances of a pardon in case the misdeeds are of a criminal nature.

3. Collective Apology (“Many to Many” or “Many to One”)

a. Types

Collective apologies take two forms: by “many to many” or by “many to one”. In the case of “many to many” one group apologizes to another group. For instance, the French railway company SNCF apologized for transporting Jews to the extermination camps during the Nazi occupation and the Vatican apologized to women for the violations of their rights and historical denigration at the hands of the Catholic Church. In the case of “many to one” a group apologizes to an individual. Clear examples are the apology by the Canadian government to Maher Arar for the ordeal he suffered as a result of his rendition to Syria or corporate apologies to individual clients for faulty services or goods.

When looking into collective apologies, the state has received most of the scholarly attention as perpetrator and apologizer. In addressing the issue of state apologies, we can speak of three contexts where such acts are considered appropriate: domestic, international and postcolonial. In the domestic realm, political apologies address injustice committed against citizens under the aegis of the state. Canada’s apology and compensation to Canadians of Chinese origin for the infamous “Chinese Head Tax” law and the United State’s apology and compensation for American citizens of Japanese descent for their internment during World War II are relevant examples. In the international realm, political apologies are important diplomatic tools and usually address injustice committed during wartime, but not only. In this category, we could discuss Japan’s “sorry” for the abuse of Korean and Chinese “comfort women” and Belgium’s expression of regret for not having intervened to prevent the genocide in Rwanda. Finally, one can identify postimperial and postcolonial relations as a context, somewhere between the domestic and the international realm. Australia’s and Canada’s apologies to their Aboriginal communities for forced assimilation policies, Queen Elizabeth’s declaration of sorrow for Britain’s treatment of New Zealand’s Maori communities, and Guatemala’s apology to a victimized Mayan community constitute important illustrations.

b. Validity Conditions

When applied to collective apologies for harms and wrongs featuring multiple perpetrators – oftentimes committed a long time ago – many of Smith’s criteria for a categorical “sorry” do not hold. Consequently, those who measure collective apologies against the standards for interpersonal apologies argue against the very idea of collective apologies, and especially against the idea of collective apologies for injustices that took place in the distant past.

First, adequately isolating each and every offence inflicted upon the victim(s) can be a daunting task when dealing with multiple perpetrators. Secondly, what do we mean by collective responsibility? In what way can we plausibly speak of collective – as opposed to individual – acts? Third, who has the proper standing to apologize for something that the collective has supposedly perpetrated: the upper echelons of the chain of command or the direct perpetrators? What about those members of the group who had not been involved in the violations? Fourth, can groups express remorse and regret? How can we measure their sincerity and commitment to transformation and redress in the absence of these emotions? Fifth, things are further complicated because often there is no consensus behind a collective’s decision to apologize.

Most of the time, some members of the community reject the idea of apologizing for a past wrong. They see public contrition as a threat to the self-image of the group and as an unnecessary tainting of its history. All recent examples of collective apologies have turned out to be controversial and antagonizing, so much so that some scholars have argued that the lack of consensus constitutes an insuperable obstacle to collective apologies. Last but not least, who should accept these collective apologies? The answer appears to be clear in the case of a “many to one” apology. But what about a “many to many” scenario? The direct victims? What about their families? And what if the members of the group that the apology addresses cannot agree on whether to accept the apology or not?

All these problems are amplified when the direct perpetrators and victims no longer exist. In such cases, there is no identity between perpetrator and apologiser or between the victim and the addressee of the apology. What is more, the potential apologizers and addressees of the apology often owe their very existence to the fact that the injustices had been committed in the past, as is the case, for example, of almost everyone in the Americas or Australia today: without the injustices committed against the First Nations and without the slave trade the demographics of the continents would look different in the 21st Century. For them to apologize sincerely, i.e. to express regret for the very events that made their existence possible, would be impossible.

One way of circumventing the identity problem is to argue that, even if they are not the direct victims, the descendants of victims suffer today the repercussions of the violations in the past. For instance, one might argue that African Americans experience today the socio-economic repercussions of a history of discrimination and oppression that goes back to the slave trade. Consequently, they are owed an apology. White Americans, on the contrary, have been the beneficiaries of the same violations, even if they are not the direct perpetrators thereof. As involuntary beneficiaries of violence they might express regret for the fact that they owe their existence to injustices committed by their ancestors.

Yet the problems do not stop here. Immigration adds to the complexity of the identity problem: should recent immigrants apologise given that they have not even benefitted from the past injustices and they do not owe their existence to the perpetrators of past injustices?

Another way of dealing with the question of the validity of collective apologies is to give up the interpersonal model and think of them as a rather distinct category, whose purposes and functions differ from those of interpersonal apologies. Thus, scholars have argued that it is normatively sound to ascribe responsibility to collectives or institutions as continuous in time and as transcending the particular individuals constituting them at a certain moment. In addition, collectives are responsible for reproducing the culture that made it possible for atrocities to go on uncontested. Therefore, collective responsibility requires that groups’ representatives acknowledge the fact that an injustice has been committed, mark discontinuity with the discriminatory practices of the past, and commit themselves to non-repetition and redress.

Collective responsibility must be conceptually distinguished from collective guilt, a philosophically more problematic notion. For example, a present government who has not committed any wrongs can still take responsibility by acknowledging that wrongs have been committed against a certain group or person in the past, that it was “our culture” that enabled the abuses, that the abuses have repercussions in the present, and that they will not be allowed to happen again. A pledge to revise the very foundations on which the relations between various groups are established within the polity and material compensations for the losses incurred by the victims give concreteness to the apology. In this sense, it can be safely said that collective apologies have both a symbolic function (recognition of the offended group as worthy of respect) and a utility function (the apology might bring about reparations to the victims and might lead to better inter-group relations).

If the issue of collective responsibility is addressed in this way, we then need to turn to the question of who has standing to apologize for the collective. Unlike interpersonal apologies—where the offender has to apologize to the offended—collective apologies depend on representation, or, in other words, they are done by proxy. If we understand collective apologies as symbolic acts and if we agree that collectives can take responsibility for past wrongs even if their current members did not commit any of the past offences, then a legitimate representative – perceived by the collective as having the authority to speak for the collective – has the standing to apologize.

Naturally, the affective dimension of the collective apology becomes less significant if we give up the interpersonal model. The representatives offering the apology might experience feelings of contrition, remorse and regret, but their emotional response is not a necessary condition of an authentic apology by collective agents such as churches, professions, or the state. While representatives speaking on behalf of the group or institution may experience such emotions, the sincerity of the act should not be measured in affective units. The “sincerity” of collective apologies should be measured in terms of what follows from the act. Changes in the norms and practices of the collective, reparations, compensation, or memorialization projects give concreteness to the symbolic act of apologizing.

Last but not least, to whom is the apology addressed? Theorists who do not take the interpersonal “sorry” as a template for the collective apology argue that they are addressed to a number of audiences. First, apologies are directed towards victims and their families and their descendants. Secondly, they are addressed to the general public, with a view to communicating that what happened in the past is in great tension with the moral principles the group subscribes to and that such abuses will not be tolerated ever again. Lastly, the international society – or more abstractly humanity as a whole – is the indirect audience of a collective apology.

c. The Goals of the Collective Apology

If we agree that we can speak meaningfully about public expressions of regret by institutions, then we will also think that they do not serve the same purposes as interpersonal apologies. Such acts aim to restore diplomatic relations, restore the dignity of insulted groups, extend the boundaries of the political community by including the formerly disenfranchised, re-establish equality among groups and recognize suffering, and stimulate reflection and change in a discriminatory public culture. They could also mark a (re-)affirmation of the fundamental moral principles of the community, promote national reconciliation, strengthen a principle of transnational cooperation and contribute to the improvement of international law and diplomatic relations, make a relationship possible by creating a less hostile environment for special groups, and mark a society’s affirmation of a set of virtues in contradistinction to a past of exclusion.

Theological approaches to the functions that collective apologies can perform add to the scholarly reflection about these political practices. In her path-breaking book on the religious dimensions of collective apologies, Celermajer uses insights from the Jewish and the Christian notions and institutions of repentance in order to support an account of collective apologies as speech acts through which “we as a community” ritually express shame for our past, appraise the impact of the past on the present and the future, and make a commitment to change who “we” are by bridging the gap between our ideals and our practices (Celermajer 2009). Other scholars have made reference to the Christian notion of covenant so as to theorise apologies as “embracing” acts and as mechanisms of possible reconciliation. Contributions by theologians thus illuminate one more normative source for the multi-faceted practice of apology: religious traditions.

d. Scepticism about Collective Apologies

While many scholars see public apologies as creating a space of communal reflection and restoration, there are strong sceptical positions that see such official acts as nothing but a “smoke screen” meant to hide the intention to avoid responsibility or further projects of assimilation and discrimination. On the basis of normative inconsistencies associated with current practices of apologies, realist scholars have objected that apologies are a form of “sentimental politics” that serves as a “seductive, feel-good strategy contrived and promoted by governments” to compensate for the lack of redistributive measures. On this view, apologies allow political elites to take the higher moral ground against those who came before them—unfairly applying current standards to the past, thus committing the sin of presentism – and to capitalize electorally.

Defenders of the value of collective apology respond that the presence of strategic reasons does not necessarily doom such practices to irrelevance. True, unless coupled with compensatory schemes and a renunciation of oppressive practices, such declarations of sorrow are signs of hypocritical and meaningless righteousness, far from appropriately addressing the atrocities for which they are issued. Compensation without an apology is also insufficient, as it cannot symbolically affirm the value of the victims. In addition, it might send the wrong signal - that of trying to “buy” the victim’s forgiveness, thus doubling the insult. To the extent that they live up to the tasks they set themselves, i.e. to the extent that they take concrete steps to address injustice symbolically and materially, apologies are “sincere”.

A different kind of criticism comes from conservative commentators who tend to be averse to the idea of apologizing for a past of state-sponsored violence. The fear that discussing the past might damage the community’s self-image pervades many democratic societies with a history of injustice. Turkey’s refusal to acknowledge the Armenian genocide and the US’s problematic relationship with its long history of racial discrimination are two notorious examples where a discomfort with the past prevents sincere processes of national reckoning.

In response to this line of critique, one can argue that democratic elites can employ two strategies: encourage everyone to participate in a political ritual of contrition and assume the unsavoury past or invite resistant groups to conceive of honesty about the past as an act of courage, not an injustice. A rhetorically powerful appeal to positive feelings of courage, rather than shame, to pride, rather than repentance, could persuade citizens to see the apology as a sign of strength, and not one of weakness.

4. Theatricality and Non-verbal Apologies

The theatrical or ritualistic dimension of the collective apology cannot be omitted from any comprehensive discussion of the practice. While public interpersonal apologies by celebrities can be analysed in terms of their theatrical aspects – just think of Arnold Schwarzenegger or Tiger Woods publicly apologizing to their spouses – it is usually collective political apologies that make a more interesting object for this type of inquiry.

Rhetoricians have pointed to the need for the apologizer to establish a special relation between herself and the audience. She should be able to give meaningful expression to common sentiment and avoid being perceived as out of touch with the public. Timing, the rhetorical register used, the tone, the educational and memorialization projects that precede the apology, and the theatrical props used should enter the consideration of those who want their apology to resonate with the wider public. Thinking of the apology in terms of theatre allows us to grasp not only the validity and power of the performance by the apologizer but also the choice that the spectator has to either accept or reject the authority of the apologizer.

While apologies have been mostly studied as verbal (oral or written) acts, some scholars have recently turned their attention to the non-verbal dimension of the practice. Willy Brandt’s kneeling in front of the monument dedicated to the Warsaw Ghetto uprising in 1970 or Pope John Paul II leaning against the Western Wall and slipping a piece of paper containing a prayer into its crevices have been interpreted as acts of apology, regret and sorrow for the suffering of the Jews at the hands of Nazi Germany and the Catholic Church, respectively. Looking into gestures, bodily posture, location and emotional expressions allows us to understand the complexity of factors that enter into an apology that resonates with its audiences, thus adding richness to any analysis of such practices.

5. Intercultural Apologies

The phenomenon of intercultural apologies – interpersonal and collective apologies between individuals with different cultural backgrounds – has been made the object of numerous empirical studies. Such studies usually compare “Western” (mostly American) and “Eastern” (mostly East-Asian) understandings of the apology.

While apologies do cut across cultures, sociologists, social psychologists and students of intercultural communication tell us that there is variation in the type and number of validity conditions, the nature of acts that should give occasion to an apology, the strength of the motivation to apologize, the kind of purposes that they are meant to serve, as well as in the form and style that the practice adopts. For instance, Western individuals and institutions are supposedly less willing to apologize, more likely to focus on the mens rea (the intention behind the offence) and on the justification of the offence, while Asian individuals and institutions are more willing to apologize unconditionally, more likely to zoom in on the consequences of the offence, and see it within its broader context.

Such variation might tempt the observer to essentialize cultures, reify the differences, and deny the possibility of meaningful apologies between members of different cultural groups. The more difficult – yet more productive – alternative is to resist the temptation of going down the path of incommensurability and to try and valorise the reconciliation potential such acts may bring about. A willingness to see the similarities beyond the differences, to adjust one’s expectations so as to accommodate the expectations of the other and to learn transculturally may pave the way to conflict resolution, be it between persons or collectives.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Andrieu, Kora. “‘Sorry for the Genocide’: How Public Apologies Can Help Promote National Reconciliation.” Millennium Journal of International Studies 38, no. 1 (2009): 3–23.
    • Uses Habermas’s notion of discursive solidarity to show how apologies can help rebuild political trust.
  • Barkan, Elazar and Alexander Karn. Taking Wrongs Seriously: Apologies and Reconciliation. Stanford CA: Stanford University Press, 2006.
    • It analyzes, in a comparative and interdisciplinary framework the role and function—as well as the limitations—that apology has in promoting dialogue, tolerance, and cooperation between groups confronting one another over past injustices.
  • Barnlund, D. & Yoshioka, M. “Apologies: Japanese and American styles.” International Journal of Intercultural Relations 14, (1990): 193-205.
    • A comparative contribution to the intercultural study of apologies, focusing on American and Japanese practices of apology.
  • Bilder, Richard B. "The Role of Apology in International Law and Diplomacy." Virginia Journal of International Law 46, no. 3 (2006): 437-473.
    • Written from the perspective of International Relations, with a focus on the diplomatic use of apologies.
  • Borneman, John. “Public Apologies as Performative Redress.” SAIS Review 25, no. 2, (2005): 59-60.
    • Explores the role of apologies in conflict resolution processes.
  • Braithwaite, John. Crime, Shame and Reintegration. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.
    • Foundational text for restorative justice in criminal law.
  • Celermajer, Danielle. The Sins of the Nation and the Ritual of Apology. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2009.
    • Explores political apologies by mobilising religious tropes from Judaism and Christianity and speech-act theory.
  • Cunningham, Michael. “Saying Story: The Politics of Apology.” The Political Quarterly 70, no 3 (1999): 285-293.
    • One of the first and clearest articles to theorise the morphology of apologies.
  • De Gruchy, John W. Reconciliation: Restoring Justice. Minneapolis MN: Fortress, 2002.
    • An essentially theological account of processes of political reconciliation.
  • Engerman, Stanley L. "Apologies, Regrets, and Reparations." European Review 17, no. 3-4 (2009): 593-610.
    • A historical examination of the development of the practice of apologies in the last few decades.
  • Gibney, Mark, Rhoda Howard-Hassman, Jean-Marc Coicaud and Niklaus Steiner (eds.). The Age of Apology: The West Faces its Own Past, Tokyo: United Nations University Press, 2006.
    • Extensive collection of essays addressing the normative issues associated with the practice of collective apologies, with a focus on state apologies.
  • Gibney, Mark and Erik Roxtrom. "The Status of State Apologies." Human Rights Quarterly 23, no. 4 (2001): 911-939.
    • Analyses the importance of transnational apologies in the development of human rights standards.
  • Gill, Kathleen. "The Moral Functions of an Apology." The Philosophical Forum 31, no. 1 (2000): 11-27.
    • Analyses the moral aspects of apologizing, considering its impact on those who offer the apology, the recipient of the apology, and relevant communities.
  • Govier, Trudy, Taking Wrongs Seriously (Amherst: Humanity Books, 2006).
    • One of the most important contributions to philosophical reflections on political reconciliation and its challenges.
  • Govier, Trudy and Wilhelm Verwoerd. “The Promise and Pitfalls of Apology,” Journal of Social Philosophy, Vol. 33, no. 1, (Spring 2002), pp. 67 – 82.
    • Uses the South African experiment in truth and reconciliation to examine the pitfalls of apologies.
  • Griswold, Charles L. Forgiveness: A Philosophical Exploration. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2007.
    • A philosophical exploration of what is involved in processes of forgiveness.
  • Horelt, Michel- André. “Performing Reconciliation: A Performance Approach to the Analysis of Political Apologies.” In Nicola Palmer, Danielle Granville and Phil Clark (eds.), Critical Perspectives on Transitional Justice (Cambridge: Intersentia, 2011):347-369.
    • One of the very few contributions exploring the role of non-verbal elements in apologies.
  • Howard-Hassmann, Rhoda. “Official Apologies”. Transitional Justice Review, Vol.1, Iss.1, (2012), 31-53.
    • Unpacks the various moral, sociological and political dimensions of collective apologies.
  • Kampf, Zohar. “Public (Non–)Apologies: The Discourse of Minimizing Responsibility.” Journal of Pragmatics 41 (2009): 2257–2270.
    • Analyses a number of apologies to highlight the strategies that officials adopt in trying to minimize their responsibility for the wrongs they are apologising for.
  • La Caze, Marguerite. “The Asymmetry between Apology and Forgiveness.” Contemporary Political Theory 5 (2006) 447–468.
    • Discusses the idea that apologizing does not trigger a duty of forgiveness for the addressee of the apology.
  • Lazare, Aaron. On Apology. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2004.
    • A psychological account of the processes involved in giving and receiving an apology.
  • Mihai, Mihaela. “When the State Says ‘Sorry’: State Apologies as Exemplary Political Judgments,” Journal of Political Philosophy 21, no. 2 (2013): 200-220.
    • Looks at how collective apologies could mobilize public support from a reluctant public who oppose the idea of an apology for past injustice.
  • Mills, Nicolaus. “The New Culture of Apology.” Dissent 48, no. 4 (2001): 113-116.
    • Discusses the growing number of public apologies and the functions they are meant to perform.
  • Negash, Girma. Apologia Politica: States & their Apologies by Proxy. Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2006.
    • Examines public apology as ethical and public discourse, recommends criteria for the apology process, analyzes historical and contemporary cases, and formulates a guide to ethical conduct in public apologies.
  • Nobles, Melissa. The Politics of Official Apologies. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2008.
    • A citizenship-based justification for the practice of collective apologies for past injustice.
  • Public Apology Database, published by the CCM Lab, the University of Waterloo.
    • A comprehensive, structured, data base of apologies.
  • Schmidt, Theron, ‘We Say Sorry’: Apology, the Law and Theatricality, Law Text Culture, 14(1), 2010, 55-78.
    • Explores the theatricality at work in three examples of publicly performed discourse.
  • Smith, Nick. I Was Wrong: The Meanings of Apologies. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008.
    • A philosophical account of the conditions of validity for interpersonal and collective apologies.
  • Sugimoto, N. “A Japan-U.S. comparison of apology styles.” Communication Research, 24 (1997): 349-370.
    • Important contribution for the intercultural study of apologies.
  • Tavuchis, Nicholas. Mea Culpa: A Sociology of Apology and Reconciliation. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1991.
    • A sociological take on apologies and one of the first books published on the topic.
  • Thaler, Mathias. “Just Pretending: Political Apologies for Historical Injustice and Vice’s Tribute to Virtue.” Critical Review of International Social and Political Philosophy 15, no. 3 (2012): 259–278.
    • Examines the sincerity condition of collective apologies and argues for a purely consequentialist view of such acts.
  • Thompson, Janna. “The Apology Paradox.” The Philosophical Quarterly 50, No. 201 (Oct., 2000): 470-475.
    • Examines the non-identity problem in apologies for historical injustices.
  • Villadsen, Kisa Storm. "Speaking on Behalf of Others: Rhetorical Agency and Epideictic Functions of Official Apologies." Rhetoric Society Quarterly 38, no. 9 (2008): 25-45.
    • Looks at apologies through the lens of rhetoric.

Author Information

Mihaela Mihai
University of York
United Kingdom

Western Theories of Justice

Justice is one of the most important moral and political concepts.  The word comes from the Latin jus, meaning right or law.  The Oxford English Dictionary defines the “just” person as one who typically “does what is morally right” and is disposed to “giving everyone his or her due,” offering the word “fair” as a synonym.  But philosophers want to get beyond etymology and dictionary definitions to consider, for example, the nature of justice as both a moral virtue of character and a desirable quality of political society, as well as how it applies to ethical and social decision-making.  This article will focus on Western philosophical conceptions of justice.  These will be the greatest theories of ancient Greece (those of Plato and Aristotle) and of medieval Christianity (Augustine and Aquinas), two early modern ones (Hobbes and Hume), two from more recent modern times (Kant and Mill), and some contemporary ones (Rawls and several successors).  Typically the article considers not only their theories of justice but also how philosophers apply their own theories to controversial social issues—for example, to civil disobedience, punishment, equal opportunity for women, slavery, war, property rights, and international relations.

For Plato, justice is a virtue establishing rational order, with each part performing its appropriate role and not interfering with the proper functioning of other parts. Aristotle says justice consists in what is lawful and fair, with fairness involving equitable distributions and the correction of what is inequitable.  For Augustine, the cardinal virtue of justice requires that we try to give all people their due; for Aquinas, justice is that rational mean between opposite sorts of injustice, involving proportional distributions and reciprocal transactions.  Hobbes believed justice is an artificial virtue, necessary for civil society, a function of the voluntary agreements of the social contract; for Hume, justice essentially serves public utility by protecting property (broadly understood).  For Kant, it is a virtue whereby we respect others’ freedom, autonomy, and dignity by not interfering with their voluntary actions, so long as those do not violate others’ rights; Mill said justice is a collective name for the most important social utilities, which are conducive to fostering and protecting human liberty.  Rawls analyzed justice in terms of maximum equal liberty regarding basic rights and duties for all members of society, with socio-economic inequalities requiring moral justification in terms of equal opportunity and beneficial results for all; and various post-Rawlsian philosophers develop alternative conceptions.

Western philosophers generally regard justice as the most fundamental of all virtues for ordering interpersonal relations and establishing and maintaining a stable political society.  By tracking the historical interplay of these theories, what will be advocated is a developing understanding of justice in terms of respecting persons as free, rational agents.  One may disagree about the nature, basis, and legitimate application of justice, but this is its core.

Table of Contents

  1. Ancient Greece
    1. Plato
    2. Aristotle
  2. Medieval Christianity
    1. Augustine
    2. Aquinas
  3. Early Modernity
    1. Hobbes
    2. Hume
  4. Recent Modernity
    1. Kant
    2. Mill
  5. Contemporary Philosophers
    1. Rawls
    2. Post-Rawls
  6. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Ancient Greece

For all their originality, even Plato’s and Aristotle’s philosophies did not emerge in a vacuum.  As far back in ancient Greek literature as Homer, the concept of dikaion, used to describe a just person, was important.  From this emerged the general concept of dikaiosune, or justice, as a virtue that might be applied to a political society.  The issue of what does and does not qualify as just could logically lead to controversy regarding the origin of justice, as well as that concerning its essence.  Perhaps an effective aid to appreciating the power of their thought is to view it in the context of the teachings of the Sophists, those itinerant teachers of fifth-century ancient Greece who tried to pass themselves off as “wise” men.  In his trial, Socrates was at pains to dissociate himself from them, after his conviction refusing to save himself, as a typical Sophist would, by employing an act of civil disobedience to escape (Dialogues, pp. 24-26, 52-56; 18b-19d, 50a-54b); Plato is more responsible than anyone else for giving them the bad name that sticks with them to this present time; and Aristotle follows him in having little use for them as instructors of rhetoric, philosophy, values, and the keys to success.  So what did these three great philosophers (literally “lovers of wisdom”) find so ideologically objectionable about the Sophists?  The brief answer is, their relativism and their skepticism.  The first important one, Protagoras, captures the former with his famous saying, “Man is the measure of all things—of the things that are, that they are, and of the things that are not, that they are not”; and he speaks to the latter with a declaration of agnosticism regarding the existence of divinities.  Gorgias (Plato named dialogues after both of them) is remembered for a striking three-part statement of skepticism, holding that nothing really exists, that, even if something did exist, we could not grasp it, and that, even if we could grasp something real, we could never express it to anyone else.  If all values are subjective and/or unknowable, then what counts as just gets reduced to a matter of shifting opinion.  We can easily anticipate how readily Sophists would apply such relativism and skepticism to justice.  For example, Thrasymachus (who figures into the first book of Plato’s Republic) is supposed to have said that there must not be any gods who care about us humans because, while justice is our greatest good, men commonly get away with injustice.  But the most significant Sophist statement regarding justice arguably comes from Antiphon, who employs the characteristic distinction between custom (nomos) and nature (physis) with devastating effect.  He claims that the laws of justice, matters of convention, should be obeyed when other people are observing us and may hold us accountable; but, otherwise, we should follow the demands of nature.  The laws of justice, extrinsically derived, presumably involve serving the good of others, the demands of nature, which are internal, serving self-interest.  He even suggests that obeying the laws of justice often renders us helpless victims of those who do not (First, pp. 211, 232, 274, 264-266).  If there is any such objective value as natural justice, then it is reasonable for us to attempt a rational understanding of it.  On the other hand, if justice is merely a construction of customary agreement, then such a quest is doomed to frustration and failure.  With this as a backdrop, we should be able to see what motivated Plato and Aristotle to seek a strong alternative.

a. Plato

Plato’s masterful Republic (to which we have already referred) is most obviously a careful analysis of justice, although the book is far more wide-ranging than that would suggest.  Socrates, Plato’s teacher and primary spokesman in the dialogue, gets critically involved in a discussion of that very issue with three interlocutors early on.  Socrates provokes Cephalus to say something which he spins into the view that justice simply boils down to always telling the truth and repaying one’s debts.  Socrates easily demolishes this simplistic view with the effective logical technique of a counter-example:  if a friend lends you weapons, when he is sane, but then wants them back to do great harm with them, because he has become insane, surely you should not return them at that time and should even lie to him, if necessary to prevent great harm.  Secondly, Polemarchus, the son of Cephalus, jumps into the discussion, espousing the familiar, traditional view that justice is all about giving people what is their due.  But the problem with this bromide is that of determining who deserves what.  Polemarchus may reflect the cultural influence of the Sophists, in specifying that it depends on whether people are our friends, deserving good from us, or foes, deserving harm.  It takes more effort for Socrates to destroy this conventional theory, but he proceeds in stages:  (1) we are all fallible regarding who are true friends, as opposed to true enemies, so that appearance versus reality makes it difficult to say how we should treat people; (2) it seems at least as significant whether people are good or bad as whether they are our friends or our foes; and (3) it is not at all clear that justice should excuse, let alone require, our deliberately harming anyone (Republic, pp. 5-11; 331b-335e).  If the first inadequate theory of justice was too simplistic, this second one was downright dangerous.

The third, and final, inadequate account presented here is that of the Sophist Thrasymachus.  He roars into the discussion, expressing his contempt for all the poppycock produced thus far and boldly asserting that justice is relative to whatever is advantageous to the stronger people (what we sometimes call the “might makes right” theory).  But who are the “stronger” people?  Thrasymachus cannot mean physically stronger, for then inferior humans would be superior to finer folks like them.  He clarifies his idea that he is referring to politically powerful people in leadership positions.  But, next, even the strongest leaders are sometimes mistaken about what is to their own advantage, raising the question of whether people ought to do what leaders suppose is to their own advantage or only what actually is so.  (Had Thrasymachus phrased this in terms of what serves the interest of society itself, the same appearance versus reality distinction would apply.)  But, beyond this, Socrates rejects the exploitation model of leadership, which sees political superiors as properly exploiting inferiors (Thrasymachus uses the example of a shepherd fattening up and protecting his flock of sheep for his own selfish gain), substituting a service model in its place (his example is of the good medical doctor, who practices his craft primarily for the welfare of patients).  So, now, if anything like this is to be accepted as our model for interpersonal relations, then Thrasymachus embraces the “injustice” of self-interest as better than serving the interests of others in the name of “justice.”  Well, then, how are we to interpret whether the life of justice or that of injustice is better?  Socrates suggests three criteria for judgment:  which is the smarter, which is the more secure, and which is the happier way of life; he argues that the just life is better on all three counts.  Thus, by the end of the first book, it looks as if Socrates has trounced all three of these inadequate views of justice, although he himself claims to be dissatisfied because we have only shown what justice is not, with no persuasive account of its actual nature (ibid., pp. 14-21, 25-31; 338c-345b, 349c-354c).  Likewise, in Gorgias, Plato has Callicles espouse the view that, whatever conventions might seem to dictate, natural justice dictates that superior people should rule over and derive greater benefits than inferior people, that society artificially levels people because of a bias in favor of equality.  Socrates is then made to criticize this theory by analyzing what sort of superiority would be relevant and then arguing that Callicles is erroneously advocating injustice, a false value, rather than the genuine one of true justice (Gorgias, pp. 52-66; 482d-493c; see, also, Laws, pp. 100-101, 172; 663, 714 for another articulation of something like Thrasymachus’ position).

In the second book of Plato’s Republic, his brothers, Glaucon and Adeimantus, take over the role of primary interlocutors.  They quickly make it clear that they are not satisfied with Socrates’ defense of justice.  Glaucon reminds us that there are three different sorts of goods—intrinsic ones, such as joy, merely instrumental ones, such as money-making, and ones that are both instrumentally and intrinsically valuable, such as health—in order to ask which type of good is justice.  Socrates responds that justice belongs in the third category, rendering it the richest sort of good.  In that case, Glaucon protests, Socrates has failed to prove his point.  If his debate with Thrasymachus accomplished anything at all, it nevertheless did not establish any intrinsic value in justice.  So Glaucon will play devil’s advocate and resurrect the Sophist position, in order to challenge Socrates to refute it in its strongest form.  He proposes to do this in three steps:  first, he will argue that justice is merely a conventional compromise (between harming others with impunity and being their helpless victims), agreed to by people for their own selfish good and socially enforced (this is a crude version of what will later become the social contract theory of justice in Hobbes); second, he illustrates our allegedly natural selfish preference for being unjust if we can get away with it by the haunting story of the ring of Gyges, which provides its wearer with the power to become invisible at will and, thus, to get away with the most wicked of injustices—to which temptation everyone would, sooner or later, rationally succumb; and, third, he tries to show that it is better to live unjustly than justly if one can by contrasting the unjust person whom everyone thinks just with the just person who is thought to be unjust, claiming that, of course, it would be better to be the former than the latter.  Almost as soon as Glaucon finishes, his brother Adeimantus jumps in to add two more points to the case against justice:  first, parents instruct their children to behave justly not because it is good in itself but merely because it tends to pay off for them; and, secondly, religious teachings are ineffective in encouraging us to avoid injustice because the gods will punish it and to pursue justice because the gods will reward it, since the gods may not even exist or, if they do, they may well not care about us or, if they are concerned about human behavior, they can be flattered with prayers and bribed with sacrifices to let us get away with wrongdoing (Republic, pp. 33-42; 357b-366e).  So the challenge for Socrates posed by Plato’s brothers is to show the true nature of justice and that it is intrinsically valuable rather than only desirable for its contingent consequences.

In defending justice against this Sophist critique, Plato has Socrates construct his own positive theory.  This is set up by means of an analogy comparing justice, on the large scale, as it applies to society, and on a smaller scale, as it applies to an individual soul.  Thus justice is seen as an essential virtue of both a good political state and a good personal character.  The strategy hinges on the idea that the state is like the individual writ large—each comprising three main parts such that it is crucial how they are interrelated—and that analyzing justice on the large scale will facilitate our doing so on the smaller one.  In Book IV, after cobbling together his blueprint of the ideal republic, Socrates asks Glaucon where justice is to be found, but they agree they will have to search for it together.  They agree that, if they have succeeded in establishing the foundations of a “completely good” society, it would have to comprise four pivotal virtues:  wisdom, courage, temperance, and justice.  If they can properly identify the other three of those four, whatever remains that is essential to a completely good society must be justice.  Wisdom is held to be prudent judgment among leaders; courage is the quality in defenders or protectors whereby they remain steadfast in their convictions and commitments in the face of fear; and temperance (or moderation) is the virtue to be found in all three classes of citizens, but especially in the producers, allowing them all to agree harmoniously that the leaders should lead and everyone else follow.  So now, by this process-of-elimination analysis, whatever is left that is essential to a “completely good” society will allegedly be justice.  It then turns out that “justice is doing one’s own work and not meddling with what isn’t one’s own.”  So the positive side of socio-political justice is each person doing the tasks assigned to him or her; the negative side is not interfering with others doing their appointed tasks.  Now we move from this macro-level of political society to the psychological micro-level of an individual soul, pressing the analogy mentioned above.  Plato has Socrates present an argument designed to show that reason in the soul, corresponding to the leaders or “guardians” of the state, is different from both the appetites, corresponding to the productive class, and the spirited part of the soul, corresponding to the state’s defenders or “auxiliaries” and that the appetites are different from spirit.  Having established the parallel between the three classes of the state and the three parts of the soul, the analogy suggests that a “completely good” soul would also have to have the same four pivotal virtues.  A good soul is wise, in having good judgment whereby reason rules; it is courageous in that its spirited part is ready, willing, and able to fight for its convictions in the face of fear; and it is temperate or moderate, harmoniously integrated because all of its parts, especially its dangerous appetitive desires, agree that it should be always under the command of reason.  And, again, what is left that is essential is justice, whereby each part of the soul does the work intended by nature, none of them interfering with the functioning of any other parts.  We are also told in passing that, corresponding to these four pivotal virtues of the moral life, there are four pivotal vices, foolishness, cowardice, self-indulgence, and injustice.  One crucial question remains unanswered:  can we show that justice, thus understood, is better than injustice in itself and not merely for its likely consequences?  The answer is that, of course, we can because justice is the health of the soul.  Just as health is intrinsically and not just instrumentally good, so is justice; injustice is a disease—bad and to be avoided even if it isn’t yet having any undesirable consequences, even if nobody is aware of it (ibid., pp. 43, 102-121; 368d, 427d-445b; it can readily be inferred that this conception of justice is non-egalitarian; but, to see this point made explicitly, see Laws, pp. 229-230; 756-757).

Now let us quickly see how Plato applies this theory of justice to a particular social issue, before briefly considering the theory critically.  In a remarkably progressive passage in Book V of his Republic, Plato argues for equal opportunity for women.  He holds that, even though women tend to be physically weaker than men, this should not prove an insuperable barrier to their being educated for the same socio-political functions as men, including those of the top echelons of leadership responsibility.  While the body has a gender, it is the soul that is virtuous or vicious.  Despite their different roles in procreation, child-bearing, giving birth, and nursing babies, there is no reason, in principle, why a woman should not be as intelligent and virtuous—including as just—as men, if properly trained.  As much as possible, men and women should share the workload in common (Republic, pp. 125-131; 451d-457d).  We should note, however, that the rationale is the common good of the community rather than any appeal to what we might consider women’s rights.  Nevertheless, many of us today are sympathetic to this application of justice in support of a view that would not become popular for another two millennia.

What of Plato’s theory of justice itself?  The negative part of it—his critique of inadequate views of justice—is a masterful series of arguments against attempts to reduce justice to a couple of simplistic rules (Cephalus), to treating people merely in accord with how we feel about them (Polemarchus), and to the power-politics mentality of exploiting them for our own selfish purposes (Thrasymachus).  All of these views of a just person or society introduce the sort of relativism and/or subjectivism we have identified with the Sophists.  Thus, in refuting them, Plato, in effect, is refuting the Sophists.  However, after the big buildup, the positive part—what he himself maintains justice is—turns out to be a letdown.  His conception of justice reduces it to order.  While some objective sense of order is relevant to justice, this does not adequately capture the idea of respecting all persons, individually and collectively, as free rational agents.  The analogy between the state and the soul is far too fragile to support the claim that they must agree in each having three “parts.”  The process-of-elimination approach to determining the nature of justice only works if those four virtues exhaust the list of what is essential here.  But do they?  What, for example, of the Christian virtue of love or the secular virtue of benevolence?  Finally, the argument from analogy, showing that justice must be intrinsically, and not merely instrumentally, valuable (because it is like the combination good of health) proves, on critical consideration, to fail.  Plato’s theory is far more impressive than the impressionistic view of the Sophists; and it would prove extremely influential in advocating justice as an objective, disinterested value.  Nevertheless, one cannot help hoping that a more cogent theory might yet be developed.

b. Aristotle

After working with Plato at his Academy for a couple of decades, Aristotle was understandably most influenced by his teacher, also adopting, for example, a virtue theory of ethics.  Yet part of Aristotle’s greatness stems from his capacity for critical appropriation, and he became arguably Plato’s most able critic as well as his most famous follower in wanting to develop a credible alternative to Sophism.  Book V of his great Nicomachean Ethics deals in considerable depth with the moral and political virtue of justice.  It begins vacuously enough with the circular claim that it is the condition that renders us just agents inclined to desire and practice justice.  But his analysis soon becomes more illuminating when he specifies it in terms of what is lawful and fair.  What is in accordance with the law of a state is thought to be conducive to the common good and/or to that of its rulers.  In general, citizens should obey such law in order to be just.  The problem is that civil law can itself be unjust in the sense of being unfair to some, so that we need to consider special justice as a function of fairness.  He analyzes this into two sorts:  distributive justice involves dividing benefits and burdens fairly among members of a community, while corrective justice requires us, in some circumstances, to try to restore a fair balance in interpersonal relations where it has been lost.  If a member of a community has been unfairly benefited or burdened with more or less than is deserved in the way of social distributions, then corrective justice can be required, as, for example, by a court of law.  Notice that Aristotle is no more an egalitarian than Plato was—while a sort of social reciprocity may be needed, it must be of a proportional sort rather than equal.  Like all moral virtues, for Aristotle, justice is a rational mean between bad extremes.  Proportional equality or equity involves the “intermediate” position between someone’s unfairly getting “less” than is deserved and unfairly getting “more” at another’s expense.  The “mean” of justice lies between the vices of getting too much and getting too little, relative to what one deserves, these being two opposite types of injustice, one of “disproportionate excess,” the other of disproportionate “deficiency” (Nicomachean, pp. 67-74, 76; 1129a-1132b, 1134a).

Political justice, of both the lawful and the fair sort, is held to apply only to those who are citizens of a political community (a polis) by virtue of being “free and either proportionately or numerically equal,” those whose interpersonal relations are governed by the rule of law, for law is a prerequisite of political justice and injustice.  But, since individuals tend to be selfishly biased, the law should be a product of reason rather than of particular rulers.  Aristotle is prepared to distinguish between what is naturally just and unjust, on the one hand, such as whom one may legitimately kill, and what is merely conventionally just or unjust, on the other, such as a particular system of taxation for some particular society.  But the Sophists are wrong to suggest that all political justice is the artificial result of legal convention and to discount all universal natural justice (ibid., pp. 77-78; 1134a-1135a; cf. Rhetoric, pp. 105-106; 1374a-b).  What is allegedly at stake here is our developing a moral virtue that is essential to the well-being of society, as well as to the flourishing of any human being.  Another valuable dimension of Aristotle’s discussion here is his treatment of the relationship between justice and decency, for sometimes following the letter of the law would violate fairness or reasonable equity.  A decent person might selfishly benefit from being a stickler regarding following the law exactly but decide to take less or give more for the sake of the common good.  In this way, decency can correct the limitations of the law and represents a higher form of justice (Nicomachean, pp. 83-84; 1137a-1138a).

In his Politics, Aristotle further considers political justice and its relation to equality.  We can admit that the former involves the latter but must carefully specify by maintaining that justice involves equality “not for everyone, only for equals.”  He agrees with Plato that political democracy is intrinsically unjust because, by its very nature, it tries to treat unequals as if they were equals.  Justice rather requires inequality for people who are unequal.  But, then, oligarchy is also intrinsically unjust insofar as it involves treating equals as unequal because of some contingent disparity, of birth, wealth, etc.  Rather, those in a just political society who contribute the most to the common good will receive a larger share, because they thus exhibit more political virtue, than those who are inferior in that respect; it would be simply wrong, from the perspective of political justice, for them to receive equal shares.  Thus political justice must be viewed as a function of the common good of a community.  It is the attempt to specify the equality or inequality among people, he admits, that constitutes a key “problem” of “political philosophy.”  He thinks we can all readily agree that political justice requires “proportional” rather than numerical equality.  But inferiors have a vested interest in thinking that those who are equal in some respect should be equal in all respects, while superiors are biased, in the opposite direction, to imagine that those who are unequal in some way should be unequal in all ways.  Thus, for instance, those who are equally citizens are not necessarily equal in political virtue, and those who are financially richer are not necessarily morally or mentally superior.  What is relevant here is “equality according to merit,” though Aristotle cannot precisely specify what, exactly, counts as merit, for how much it must count, who is to measure it, and by what standard.  All he can suggest, for example in some of his comments on the desirable aristocratic government, is that it must involve moral and intellectual virtue (Politics, pp. 79, 81, 86, 134, 136, 151, 153; 1280a, 1281a, 1282b, 1301a-1302a, 1307a, 1308a).

Let us now consider how Aristotle applies his own theory of justice to the social problem of alleged superiors and inferiors, before attempting a brief critique of that theory.  While Plato accepted slavery as a legitimate social institution but argued for equal opportunity for women, in his Politics, Aristotle accepts sexual inequality while actively defending slavery.  Anyone who is inferior intellectually and morally is properly socio-politically inferior in a well-ordered polis.  A human being can be naturally autonomous or not, “a natural slave” being defective in rationality and morality, and thus naturally fit to belong to a superior; such a human can rightly be regarded as “a piece of property,” or another person’s “tool for action.”  Given natural human inequality, it is allegedly inappropriate that all should rule or share in ruling.  Aristotle holds that some are marked as superior and fit to rule from birth, while others are inferior and marked from birth to be ruled by others.  This supposedly applies not only to ethnic groups, but also to the genders, and he unequivocally asserts that males are “naturally superior” and females “naturally inferior,” the former being fit to rule and the latter to be ruled.  The claim is that it is naturally better for women themselves that they be ruled by men, as it is better for “natural slaves” that they should be ruled by those who are “naturally free.”  Now Aristotle does argue only for natural slavery.  It was the custom (notice the distinction, used here, between custom and nature) in antiquity to make slaves of conquered enemies who become prisoners of war.  But Aristotle (like Plato) believes that Greeks are born for free and rational self-rule, unlike non-Greeks (“barbarians”), who are naturally inferior and incapable of it.  So the fact that a human being is defeated or captured is no assurance that he is fit for slavery, as an unjust war may have been imposed on a nobler society by a more primitive one.  While granting that Greeks and non-Greeks, as well as men and women, are all truly human, Aristotle justifies the alleged inequality among them based on what he calls the “deliberative” capacity of their rational souls.  The natural slave’s rational soul supposedly lacks this, a woman has it but it lacks the authority for her to be autonomous, a (free male) child has it in some developmental stage, and a naturally superior free male has it developed and available for governance (ibid., pp. 7-11, 23; 1254a-1255a, 1260a).

This application creates a helpful path to a critique of Aristotle’s theory of justice.  If we feel that it is unjust to discriminate against people merely on account of their gender and/or ethnic origin, as philosophers, we try to identify the rational root of the problem.  If our moral intuitions are correct against Aristotle (and some would even call his views here sexist and racist), he may be mistaken about a matter of fact or about a value judgment or both.  Surely he is wrong about all women and non-Greeks, as such, being essentially inferior to Greek males in relevant ways, for cultural history has demonstrated that, when given opportunities, women and non-Greeks have shown themselves to be significantly equal.  But it appears that Aristotle may also have been wrong in leaping from the factual claim of inequality to the value judgment that it is therefore right that inferiors ought to be socially, legally, politically, and economically subordinate—like Plato and others of his culture (for which he is an apologist here), Aristotle seems to have no conception of human rights as such.  Like Plato, he is arguing for an objective theory of personal and social justice as a preferable alternative to the relativistic one of the Sophists.  Even though there is something attractive about Aristotle’s empirical (as opposed to Plato’s idealistic) approach to justice, it condemns him to the dubious position of needing to derive claims about how things ought to be from factual claims about the way things actually are.  It also leaves Aristotle with little viable means of establishing a universal perspective that will respect the equal dignity of all humans, as such.  Thus his theory, like Plato’s, fails adequately to respect all persons as free, rational agents.  They were so focused on the ways in which people are unequal, that they could not appreciate any fundamental moral equality that might provide a platform for natural human rights.

2. Medieval Christianity

When Christian thinkers sought to develop their own philosophies in the middle ages (“medieval” meaning the middle ages and “middle” in the sense of being between antiquity and modernity), they found precious basic building-blocks in ancient thought.  This included such important post-Aristotelians as the enormously influential Roman eclectic Cicero, such prominent Stoics as Marcus Aurelius (a Roman emperor) and Epictetus (a Greek slave of the Romans), and neo-Platonists like Plotinus.  But the two dominant paths that medieval philosophy would follow for its roughly thousand year history had been blazed by Plato and Aristotle.  More specifically, Augustine uses Platonic (and neo-Platonic) philosophy to the extent that he can reconcile it with Christian thought; Aquinas, many centuries later, develops a great synthesis of Christian thought (including that of Augustine) and Aristotelian philosophy.  A great difference, however, between their philosophies and those of Hellenic thinkers such as Plato and Aristotle stems from the commitment of these Christians to the authority of the Hebrew and Christian scriptures.  Aquinas would later agree with Augustine (who is accepting the mandate of Isaiah 7:9) that the quest for philosophical understanding should begin with belief in religious traditions (Choice, pp. 3, 32).  Both the Old Testament and the New Testament call for just behavior on the part of righteous people, with injustice being a sin against God’s law, the references being too numerous to cite (but see Job 9:2, Proverbs 4:18, Proverbs 10:6-7, Ecclesiastes 7:20, Matthew 5:45, Philippians 4:8, and Hebrews 12:23).  The claim that God’s justice will prevail in the form of divine judgment is both a promise for the just and a threat for the unjust.  Righteousness is identified with mercy as well as with justice (e.g., Micah 6:8 and Matthew 5:7) and involves our relationship with God as well as with fellow humans.  The ten commandments of the Old Testament (Exodus 20:1-17) are prescriptions regarding how the righteous are to relate to God as well as to one another.  In the New Testament, Jesus of Nazareth interprets how the righteous are to live (Matthew 22:36-40) in terms of love of both God and their neighbors; the concept of one’s neighbor is meant to extend even to strangers, as is illustrated in the parable of the Good Samaritan (Luke 10:29-37).  In the Beatitudes beginning the Sermon on the Mount, Jesus expands on this gospel of love by advocating that his followers go beyond the duties of justice to behave with compassion in certain supererogatory ways (Matthew 5:3-12).  All of this scriptural tradition essentially influenced medieval thinkers such as Augustine and Aquinas in a way that distinguishes them from ancient Greek philosophers such as Plato and Aristotle.

a. Augustine

Aurelius Augustine was born and raised in the Roman province of North Africa; during his life, he experienced the injustices, the corruption, and the erosion of the Roman Empire.  This personal experience, in dialectical tension with the ideals of Christianity, provided him with a dramatic backdrop for his religious axiology.  Philosophically, he was greatly influenced by such neo-Platonists as Plotinus.  His Christian Platonism is evident in his philosophical dialogue On Free Choice of the Will, in which he embraces Plato’s view of four central moral virtues (which came to be called “cardinal,” from the Latin word for hinges, these being metaphorically imaginable as the four hinges on which the door of morality pivots).  These are prudence (substituted for wisdom), fortitude or courage, temperance, and justice.  His conception of justice is the familiar one of “the virtue by which all people are given their due.”  But this is connected to something new and distinctly Christian—the distinction between the temporal law, such as the law of the state, and the eternal, divine law of God.  The eternal law establishes the order of God’s divine providence.  And, since all temporal or human law must be consistent with God’s eternal law, Augustine can draw the striking conclusion that, strictly speaking, “an unjust law is no law at all,” an oxymoron (Choice, pp. 20, 11, 8; cf. Religion, p. 89, for an analysis of justice that relates it to love).  Thus a civil law of the state that violates God’s eternal law is not morally binding and can be legitimately disobeyed in good conscience.  This was to have a profound and ongoing influence on Christian ethics.

In his masterpiece, The City of God, Augustine draws the dramatic conclusion from this position that the Roman Empire was never a truly just political society.  He expresses his disgust over its long history of “revolting injustice.”  Rome was always a pagan, earthly city, and “true justice” can allegedly only be found in a Christian “city of God.”  The just, rather than the powerful, should rule for the common good, rather than serving their own self-interest.  He strikingly compares unjust societies, based on might rather than on right, to “gangs of criminals on a large scale,” for, without justice, a kingdom or empire is merely ruled by the arbitrary fiat of some leader(s).  A genuinely just society must be based on Christian love, its peaceful order established by the following of two basic rules—that people harm nobody and that they should try to help everyone to the extent that they can do so (City, pp. 75, 67, 75, 138-139, 873).

Despite his Christian commitment to love and peace, Augustine is not a pacifist and can support “just wars” as morally permissible and even as morally obligatory.  Every war aims at the order of some sort of established peace; while an unjust war aims to establish an unjust peace of domination, a just war aims to establish a “just peace.”  He agrees with Cicero that a just war must be defensive rather than aggressive (ibid., pp. 861-862, 866, 868-869, 1031).  In a letter (# 138) to Marcellinus, Augustine uses scripture to deny that Christian doctrine is committed to pacifism, though wars should be waged, when necessary, with a benevolent love for the enemy.  In a letter (# 189) to Boniface, he maintains that godly, righteous people can serve in the military, again citing scripture to support his position.  He repeats the view that a just war should aim at establishing a lasting and just peace and holds that one must keep faith with both one’s allies and one’s enemies, even in the awful heat of warfare.  Augustine’s most important treatment of the just war theory is contained in his writing Against Faustus the Manichean, where he analyzes the evils of war in terms of the desire to harm others, the lust for revenge and cruelty, and the wish to dominate other people.  In addition to the condition that a just war must aim at establishing a just and lasting peace, a second condition is that it must be declared by a leader or body of leaders, with the “authority” to do so, after deliberating that it is justified.  Again Augustine makes it clear that he is no pacifist (Political, pp. 209, 219-223).

While this is a very valuable application of his theory of justice, this doctrine of the just war standing the test of time to this very day, the general theory on which it is based is more problematic.  The unoriginal (and uninspired) conception of justice as giving others their due had already become familiar to the point of being trite.  It remains vulnerable to the serious problems of vagueness already considered:  what is the relevant criterion whereby it should be determined who deserves what, and who is fit to make such a judgment?  But, also, Augustine should have an advantage over the ancient Greeks in arriving at a theory of justice based on universal equality on account of the Christian doctrine (not to mention because of the influences of Cicero, the Stoics, and Plotinus) that all humans are equally children of God.  Unfortunately, his zealous Christian evangelism leads him to identify justice itself, in a divisive, intolerant, polemical way, with the Christian church’s idea of what God requires, so that only a Christian society can possibly qualify as just, as if a just political society would need to be a theocracy.  Thus, while he has some sense of some moral or spiritual equality among humans, it does not issue in equal respect for all persons as free, rational agents, allowing him, for example, to accept the institution of slavery as a just punishment for sin, despite the belief that God originally created humans as naturally free, because of the idea that we have all been corrupted by original sin (City, pp. 874-875).

b. Aquinas

As Augustine is arguably the greatest Christian Platonist, so Thomas Aquinas, from what is now Italy, is the greatest Christian Aristotelian.  Nevertheless, as we shall see, his theory of justice is also quite compatible with Augustine’s.  Aquinas discusses the same four cardinal moral virtues, including that of justice, in his masterpiece, the multi-volume Summa Theologica.  No more a socio-political egalitarian than Plato, Aristotle, or Augustine, he analyzes it as calling for proportional equality, or equity, rather than any sort of strict numerical equality, and as a function of natural right rather than of positive law.  Natural right ultimately stems from the eternal, immutable will of God, who created the world and governs it with divine providence.  Natural justice must always take precedence over the contingent agreements of our human conventions.  Human law must never contravene natural law, which is reason’s way of understanding God’s eternal law.  He offers us an Aristotelian definition, maintaining that “justice is a habit whereby a man renders to each one his due by a constant and perpetual will.”  As a follower of Aristotle, he defines concepts in terms of genus and species.  In this case, the general category to which justice belongs is that it is a moral habit of a virtuous character.  What specifically distinguishes it from other moral virtues is that by justice, a person is consistently committed to respecting the rights of others over time.  Strictly speaking, the virtue of justice always concerns interpersonal relations, so that it is only metaphorically that we can speak of a person being just to himself.  In addition to legal justice, whereby a person is committed to serving the “common good” of the entire community, there is “particular justice,” which requires that we treat individuals in certain ways.  Justice is a rational mean between the vicious extremes of deficiency and excess, having to do with our external actions regarding others.  Like many of his predecessors, Aquinas considers justice to be preeminent among the moral virtues.  He agrees with Aristotle in analyzing particular justice into two types, which he calls “distributive” and “commutative”; the former governs the proportional distribution of common goods, while the latter concerns the reciprocal dealings between individuals in their voluntary transactions (Law, pp. 137, 139, 145, 147, 155, 160, 163, 165).

Aquinas applies this theory of justice to many social problems.  He maintains that natural law gives us the right to own private property.  Given this natural right, theft (surreptitiously stealing another’s property) and robbery (taking it openly by force or the threat of violence) must be unjust, although an exception can arise if the thief and his family are starving in an environment of plenty, in which case, stealing is justified and, strictly speaking, not theft or robbery at all.  Secondly, Aquinas refines the Augustinian just war theory by articulating three conditions that must jointly be met in order for the waging of war to be just:  (a) it must be declared by a leader with socio-political authority; (b) it must be declared for a “just cause,” in that the people attacked must be at fault and thus deserve it; and (c) those going to war must intend good and the avoidance of evil.  It is not justifiable deliberately to slay innocent noncombatants.  It is legitimate to kill another in self-defense, though one’s intention should be that of saving oneself, the taking of the other’s life merely being the necessary means to that good end (this, by the way, is the source of what later evolves into the moral principle of “double effect”).  Even acting in self-defense must be done in reasonable proportion to the situation, so that it is wrong to employ more force than is necessary to stop aggression.  Even killing another unintentionally can be unjust if done in the course of committing another crime or through criminal negligence.  Thirdly, while Aquinas thinks we should tolerate the religious beliefs of those who have never been Christians, so that it would be unjust to persecute them, he thinks it just to use force against heretics who adhered to but then rejected orthodox Christianity, even to the point of hurting them, as in the Inquisition, for the good of their own souls.  In an extreme case of recalcitrant heretics who will not be persuaded to return to the truth of Christianity, it is allegedly just that they should be “exterminated” by execution rather than being allowed to corrupt other Christians by espousing their heterodox religious views.  Fourth, like Augustine, Aquinas accepts slavery, so long as no Christian is the slave of a non-Christian (ibid., pp. 178-183, 186, 221, 224, 226, 228, 250, 256, 253), and considers it just that women should be politically and economically “subject” to men.  Although he considers women to be fully human, he agrees with Aristotle that they are “defective and misbegotten,” the consequence allegedly being inferior rational discretion (Summa, pp. 466-467).

From a critical perspective, his general theory of justice is, by now, quite familiar, a sort of blend of Aristotle’s and Augustine’s, and marked by the same flaws as theirs.  His applications of the theory can be regarded as indicative of its problematic character:  (a) given the assumption of a right to own private property, his discussion of the injustices of theft and robbery seems quite reasonable; (b) assuming that we have a right to self-defense, his analysis of the legitimacy of killing in a just war does also; (c) his attempted defense of the persecution of religious heretics, even unto death, invites suspicions of dogmatic, intolerant fanaticism on his part; and (d) his acceptance of slavery and the political and economic subjection of women as just is indicative of an empirical orientation that is too uncritically accepting of the status quo.  Here again the Christian belief that all humans are personal creatures of a loving God is vitiated by an insufficient commitment to the implications of that, regarding socio-political equality, so that only some humans are fully respected as free, rational agents.  The rationalistic theories of Plato and Augustine and the classical empirical theories of Aristotle and Aquinas all leave us hoping that preferable alternatives might be forthcoming.

3. Early Modernity

Although only half as much time elapses between Aquinas and Hobbes as did between Augustine and Aquinas, from the perspective of intellectual history, the period of modernism represents a staggering sea-change.  We have neither the time nor the space to consider the complex causal nexus that explains this fact; but, for our purposes, suffice it to say that the Protestant Reformation, the revolution of the new science, and the progressive willingness publicly to challenge authority (both political and religious) converge to generate a strikingly different philosophical mentality in the seventeenth century.  In the previous century, the Protestant Reformation shattered the hegemony of the Roman Catholic Church, so that thinkers need not feel so constrained to adhere to established orthodoxy.  The naturalistic worldview of the sixteenth and early seventeenth centuries that eventuated in an empirical and experimental (non-dogmatic) methodology in both natural and political science set an example for philosophers.  Thinkers of the modern era became increasingly comfortable breaking from the mainstream to pursue their own independent reasoning.  Although the influence of great ancient philosophers like Plato and Aristotle and of great medieval thinkers such as Augustine and Aquinas would persist, there was no returning to their bygone perspectives.  This vitally affects moral and political theory, in general, and views on justice, in particular.  As we shall see in this section, views of justice as relative to human needs and interests became prominent as they had not been for a couple of millennia.  This will locate Hobbes and Hume closer to the Sophists than had been fashionable since pre-Socratic times in philosophy, regarding justice as a social construct.

a. Hobbes

Whereas Plato, Aristotle, Augustine, and Aquinas all offer accounts of justice that represent alternatives to Sophism, Thomas Hobbes, the English radical empiricist, can be seen as resurrecting the Sophist view that we can have no objective knowledge of it as a moral or political absolute value.  His radical empiricism does not allow him to claim to know anything not grounded in concrete sense experience.  This leads him in Leviathan, his masterpiece, to conclude that anything real must be material or corporeal in nature, that body is the one and only sort of reality; this is the philosophical position of materialistic monism, which rules out the possibility of any spiritual substance.  On this view, “a man is a living body,” only different in kind from other animals, but with no purely spiritual soul separating him from the beasts.  Like other animals, man is driven by instinct and appetite, his reason being a capacity of his brain for calculating means to desirable ends.  Another controversial claim here is that all actions, including all human actions, are causally determined to occur as they do by the complex of their antecedent conditions; this is causal determinism.  What we consider voluntary actions are simply those we perform in which the will plays a significant causal role, human freedom amounting to nothing more exalted than the absence of external restraints.  Like other animals, we are always fundamentally motivated by a survival instinct and ultimately driven by self-interest in all of our voluntary actions; this is psychological egoism.  It is controversial whether he also holds that self-interest should always be our fundamental motivation, which is ethical egoism.  In his most famous Chapter XIII, Hobbes paints a dramatic and disturbing portrait of what human life would be like in a state of nature—that is, beyond the conventional order of civil society.  We would be rationally distrustful of one another, inclined to be anti-social, viewing others as threats to our own satisfaction and well-being.  Interpersonal antagonism would be natural; and, since there would exist no moral distinctions between right and wrong, just and unjust, violent force and fraudulent deception would be desirable virtues rather than objectionable vices.  In short, this would be a state of “war of every man against every man,” a condition in which we could not reasonably expect to survive for long or to enjoy any quality of life for as long as we did.  We are smart enough to realize that this would be a condition in which, as Hobbes famously writes, “the life of man” would inevitably be “solitary, poor, nasty, brutish, and short.”  Fortunately, our natural passions of fear, desire, and hope motivate us to use reason to calculate how we might escape this hellish state.  Reason discovers a couple of basic laws of nature, indicating how we should prudently behave if we are to have any reasonable opportunity to survive, let alone to thrive.  The first of these is double-sided:  the positive side holds that we should try to establish peace with others, for our own selfish good, if we can; the negative side holds that, if we cannot do that, then we should do whatever it takes to destroy whoever might be a threat to our interests.  The second law of nature maintains that, in order to achieve peace with others, we must be willing to give up our right to harm them, so long as they agree to reciprocate by renouncing their right to harm us.  This “mutual transferring of right,” established by reciprocal agreement, is the so-called social contract that constitutes the basis of civil society; and the agreement can be made either explicitly or implicitly (Leviathan, pp. 261-262, 459-460, 79, 136, 82, 95, 74-78, 80-82; for comparable material, see Elements, pp. 78-84, 103-114, as well as Citizen, pp. 109-119, 123-124).

What is conspicuously missing here is any sense of natural justice or injustice.  In the state of nature, all moral values are strictly relative to our desires:  whatever seems likely to satisfy our desires appears “good” to us, and whatever seems likely to frustrate our desires we regard as “evil.”  It’s all relative to what we imaginatively associate with our own appetites and aversions.  But as we move from this state of nature to the state of civil society by means of the social contract, we create the rules of justice by means of the agreements we strike with one another.  Prior to the conventions of the contract, we were morally free to try to do whatever we wished.  But when a covenant is made, then to break it is unjust; and the definition of injustice is no other than the not performance of covenant.  What is not unjust, is just in civil society.  This turns out to be the third law of nature, that, in the name of justice, we must try to keep our agreements.  In civil society, we may justly do anything we have not, at least implicitly, committed ourselves not to do.  A just person typically does just actions, though committing one or a few unjust actions does not automatically render that person unjust, especially if the unjust behavior stems from an error or sudden passion; on the other hand, a person who is typically inclined to commit unjust actions is a guilty person.  Still, if we are as selfishly motivated by our own desires as Hobbes maintains, why should we not break our word and voluntarily commit injustice, if doing so is likely to pay off for us and we imagine we might get away with it (remember the problem posed by Glaucon with the story of the ring of Gyges)?  Clearly one more element is needed to prevent the quick disintegration of the rules of justice so artificially constructed by interpersonal agreement.  This is the power of sovereign authority.  We need laws codifying the rules of justice; and they must be so vigilantly and relentlessly enforced by absolute political power that nobody in his right mind would dare to try to violate them.  People simply cannot be trusted to honor their social commitments without being forced to do so, since “covenants without the sword are but words, and of no strength to secure a man at all.”  In other words, we must sacrifice a great deal of our natural liberty to achieve the sort of security without which life is hardly worth living.  In civil society, our freedom is relative to the lack of specified obligations, what Hobbes calls “the silence of the law.”  If we worry that this invests too much power in the government, which may abuse that power and excessively trample on our freedom, the (cynical) response is that this is preferable to the chaos of the state of nature or to the horrors of civil war (Leviathan, pp. 28-29, 89, 93, 106, 109, 143, 117; for comparable material, see Elements, pp. 88-89, Citizen, pp. 136-140, and Common, p. 34).  One of the most crucial problems of political philosophy is where to strike the balance between personal liberty and public order; Hobbes is, perhaps, more willing than most of us to give up a great deal of the former in order to secure the latter.

As we have with earlier thinkers, let us see how Hobbes applies this theory of justice, as a prelude to evaluating it critically.  He compares the laws of civil society to “artificial chains” binding us to obey the sovereign authority of the state in the name of justice.  The third law of nature, the law of justice, obliges us to obey the “positive” laws of the state.  Any deliberate violation of civil law is a “crime.”  Now the social problem to be considered is that of criminal punishment.  This deliberately inflicts some sort of “evil” on an alleged criminal for violating civil law.  Its rationale is to enforce obedience to the law itself and, thus, to promote security and public order.  Hobbes lays down various conditions that must be met in order for such an infliction of evil to qualify as legitimate “punishment,” including that no retroactive punishment is justifiable.  He also analyzes five sorts of criminal punishment—“corporal, or pecuniary, or ignominy, or imprisonment, or exile,” allowing for a combination of them; he also specifies that the corporal sort can be capital punishment.  It would be wrong for the state deliberately to punish a member of civil society believed to be innocent; indeed, strictly speaking, it would not even qualify as “punishment,” as it fails to meet an essential part of the definition.  The severity of punishment should be relative to the severity of the crime involved, since its rationale is to deter future violations of civil law (Leviathan, pp. 138, 173, 175, 185, 190, 203-208, 230; see, also, Elements, pp. 177-182, and Citizen, pp. 271-279; near the end of his verse autobiography—Elements, p. 264—Hobbes writes, “Justice I Teach, and Justice Reverence”).

While this is a decent consequentialist theory of crime and punishment, the more general view of justice from which it is derived is far more problematic.  It does stand in sharp contrast to the theories of Plato, Aristotle, Augustine, and Aquinas.  It does revive something like the Sophist theory to which they were all advocating alternatives.  And it does reflect the naturalistic approach represented by the new science.  However, all the foundational elements supporting it are quite dubious:  the radical empiricism, the materialism, the determinism, the egoism, the moral relativism, and the narrow conception of human reason.  Without these props, this theory of justice as artificially constructed by us and purely a function of our interpersonal agreements seems entirely arbitrary.  But in addition to its being insufficiently justified, this theory of justice would justify too much.  For example, what would prevent its involving a justification of slavery, if the alternative for the slaves were death as enemies in a state of nature?  Even apart from the issue of slavery, in the absence of any substantive human rights, minorities in civil society might be denied any set of civil liberties, such as the right to adopt religious practices to which they feel called in conscience.  Hobbes’s conception of justice is reductionistic, reducing it to conventional agreements that seem skewed to sacrifice too much liberty on the altar of law and order.

b. Hume

As a transition between Hobbes and Hume, brief mention can be made of John Locke, the most important political philosopher between them.  (The reason he is not being considered at length here is that he does not offer a distinctive general theory of justice.)  In his masterful Second Treatise of Government, Locke describes a state of nature governed by God’s law but insecure in that there is no mechanism for enforcing it, when the natural rights of property—comprising one’s life, liberty, and estates—are violated.  In order to protect such property rights, people agree to a social contract that moves them from that state of nature to a state of political society, with government established to enforce the law.  Another great social contract theorist between Hobbes and Hume who is worth mentioning here (again he gives us no distinctive theory of justice) is Jean-Jacques Rousseau.  In The Social Contract, he maintains that, in a well-ordered society, the general will (rather than the will of any individual or group of individuals) must prevail.  True freedom in society requires following the general will, and those who do not choose to do so can legitimately be forced to do so.  A human being is allegedly so transformed by the move from the state of nature to that of civil society as to become capable of such genuine freedom as will allow each citizen to consent to all the laws out of deference to the common good.   David Hume, an eighteenth-century Scottish thinker, who is very influenced by Locke’s focus on property while rejecting the social contract theory of Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau, is an interesting philosopher to consider in relation to Hobbes.  Like Hobbes, Hume is a radical empiricist and a determinist who is skeptical of justice as an objective, absolute virtue.  But Hume does not explicitly embrace materialism, is not a psychological or ethical egoist, and famously attacks the social contract theory’s account of moral and political obligation on both historical grounds (there is no evidence for it, and history shows that force rather than consent has been the basis of government) and philosophical grounds (even if our ancestors had given their consent, that would not be binding on us, and utility is a more plausible explanation of submission than genuine agreement) alike (Essays, pp. 186-201).  In the third section of his Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals, Hume argues that “public utility is the sole origin of justice.”  To place that claim in context, we can note that, like Hobbes, Hume sees all values, including that of justice, as derived from our passions rather than (as Plato, Aristotle, Augustine, and Aquinas thought) from reason.  Any virtue, he maintains, is desirable in that it provides us with the pleasant feeling of approval; and any vice, including that of injustice, is undesirable in that it provides us with the painful sense of disapproval.  In order to qualify as a virtue, a quality must be “useful or agreeable to the person himself or to others.”  It is possible for some virtues to be rich enough to fit appropriately in more than one of these four categories (for example, benevolence seems to be useful and agreeable to both the benevolent person and to others); but justice is purportedly a virtue only because it is useful to others, as members of society.  Hume offers us a unique and fascinating argument to prove his point.  He imagines four hypothetical scenarios, in which either human nature would be radically different (utterly altruistic or brutally selfish) or our environment would be so (with everything we desire constantly and abundantly available or so destitute that hardly anyone could survive), allegedly showing that, in each of them, justice would not be a virtue at all.  His conclusion is that justice is only a virtue because, relative to reality, which is intermediate among these extremes, it is beneficial to us as members of society.  He also refuses to identify justice with “perfect equality,” maintaining that the ideal of egalitarianism is both “impracticable” and “extremely pernicious to human society.”  For Hume, the rules of justice essentially involve protecting private property, although property rights are not absolute and may be abridged in extreme cases where “public safety” and the common good require it.  Even international relations normally require that “rules of justice” be observed for mutual advantage, although public utility can also require that they should be suspended (Enquiry, pp. 20, 85, 72, 21-25, 28-35; see also Essays, pp. 20, 202).  Though different from Hobbes’s theory, this one also leans towards the Sophist view of justice as conventional and relative.

In his masterpiece, A Treatise of Human Nature, Hume makes the striking claim, “Reason is, and ought only to be the slave of the passions,” which rules out all forms of ethical rationalism.  He also makes a remarkable distinction between descriptive language regarding what “is, and is not,” on the one hand, and prescriptive language concerning what “ought, or ought not” to be, on the other, challenging the possibility of ever justifying value claims by means of any factual ones, of logically inferring what should be from what is.  The second part of Book 3 of Hume’s Treatise deals extensively with justice.  Here he calls it an “artificial” but “not arbitrary” virtue, in that we construct it as a virtue for our own purposes, relative to our needs and circumstances, as we experience them.  It is valuable as a means to the end of social cooperation, which is mutually “advantageous.”   An especially beneficial, if unnatural, convention is respecting others’ property, which is what the rules of justice essentially require of us.  The psychological grounds of our sense of justice are a combination of “self-interest” and “sympathy” for others.  He holds a very conservative view of property rights, in that, normally, people should be allowed to keep what they already have acquired.  Indeed, justice normally comprises three principles—“of the stability of possession, of its transference by consent, and of the performance of promises.”  He rejects the traditional definition of justice as giving others their due, because it rashly and wrongly assumes that “right and property” have prior objective reality independent of conventions of justice.  Internationally, the rules of justice assume the status of “the law of nations,” obliging civilized governments to respect the ambassadors of other countries, to declare war prior to engaging them in battle, to refrain from using poisonous weapons against them, and so forth.  The rationale for such principles of international justice is that they reduce the horrors of war and facilitate the advantages of peace.  By respecting other societies’ possessions, leaders minimize the likelihood of war; by respecting the transference of possessions by mutual consent, they enhance the possibilities of international trade; and by keeping their promises, they create a climate for peaceful alliances.  A bit later, Hume adopts a position which, in the twentieth century, has been called a “rule utilitarian” view of justice, writing that, though individual acts of justice might be contrary to public utility, they ought to be performed if they are conducive to “a general scheme or system” of conduct that benefits society as a whole (Treatise, pp. 266, 302, 311, 307, 312, 315, 320-321, 323, 337-338, 362-363, 370-371).  Yet the rules of justice that are normally conducive to public utility are never absolute and can be legitimately contravened where following them would seem to do more harm than good to our society.  He applies this view to the issue of civil disobedience, which is normally unjust because it threatens “public utility” but can be justified as a last resort “in extraordinary circumstances” when that same public utility is in jeopardy (Essays, pp. 202-204).  Whether that is or is not the case in specific circumstances becomes a judgment call.

Hume is important here because of a convergence of several factors.  First, like the Sophists and Hobbes, he makes justice a social construct that is relative to human needs and interests.  Second, like Hobbes, he associates it fundamentally with human passions rather than with reason.  Third, the virtue of justice and the rules of justice are essentially connected to the protection of private property.  And, fourth, he considers public utility to be the sole basis of justice.  This theory would prove extremely influential, in that Kant will take issue with it, while utilitarians like Mill will build on its flexibility.  This sort of flexibility is both a strength and a weakness of Hume’s theory of justice.  While it may be attractive to allow for exceptions to the rules, this also creates a kind of instability.  Is justice merely an instrumental good, having no intrinsic value?  If that were the case, then it would make sense to say that the role of reason is simply to calculate the most effective means to our most desirable ends.  But then, assuming that our ends were sufficiently desirable, any means necessary to achieve them would presumably be justifiable—so that, morally and politically, anything goes, in principle, regardless how revolting.  Finally, notice that Hume himself, because of the empirical nature of his practical philosophy, fails to avoid the “is-ought” trap against which he so deftly warned us:  because some end is sufficiently desired, whatever means are necessary, or even most effective, to achieve it ought to be pursued.  Is this the best we can do in our pursuit of an adequate theory of justice?

4. Recent Modernity

Moving from one of the greatest philosophers of the Enlightenment to the other, we shall see that Kant will take more seriously the “is-ought” challenge than Hume himself did.  As justice is both a moral and a political virtue, helping to prescribe both a good character and right conduct, the question of how such obligations arise is crucial.  For Hume, we ought to pursue virtue (including justice) because it (allegedly) is agreeable and/or useful to do so.  But, then, what is the logical link here?  Why should we, morally speaking, act for the sake of agreeableness and utility?  For Kant, the reason we should choose to do what is right has nothing to do with good consequences.  It is merely because it is the right thing to do.  Conceding that prescriptive “ought” claims can never be logically deduced from any set of factually descriptive “is” claims, Kant will forsake the empirical approach to justice (of Hobbes and Hume) in favor of the sort of rationalistic one that will revert to seeing it as an absolute value, not to be compromised, regardless of circumstances and likely consequences.  Then we shall consider the utilitarian response to this, as developed by the philosopher who is, arguably, the greatest consequentialist of modern times, John Stuart Mill, who, as an empiricist, like Hobbes and Hume, will make what is right a function of what is good.

a. Kant

Immanuel Kant, an eighteenth-century German professor from East Prussia, found his rationalistic philosophical convictions profoundly challenged by Hume’s formidable skepticism (as well as being fascinated by the ideas of Rousseau).  Even though he was not convinced by it, Kant was sufficiently disturbed by it that he committed decades to trying to answer it, creating a revolutionary new philosophical system in order to do so.  This system includes, but is far from limited to, a vast, extensive practical philosophy, comprising many books and essays, including a theory of justice.  It is well known that this practical philosophy—including both his ethical theory and socio-political philosophy—is the most renowned example of deontology (from the Greek, meaning the study or science of duty).  Whereas teleological or consequentialist theories (such as those of Hobbes and Hume) see what is right as a function of and relative to good ends, a deontological theory such as Kant’s sees what is right as independent of what we conceive to be good and, thus, as potentially absolute.  Justice categorically requires a respect for the right, regardless of inconvenient or uncomfortable circumstances and regardless of desirable and undesirable consequences.  Because of the “is-ought” problem, the best way to proceed is to avoid the empirical approach that is necessarily committed to trying to derive obligations from alleged facts.

This is precisely Kant’s approach in the foundational book of his system of practical philosophy, his Grounding for the Metaphysics of Morals.  He argues, in its Preface, that, since the moral law “must carry with it absolute necessity” and since empiricism only yields “contingent and uncertain” results, we must proceed by way of “pure practical reason, “ which would be, to the extent possible, “purified of everything empirical,” such as physiological, psychological, and environmental contingencies.  On this view, matters of right will be equally applicable to all persons as potentially autonomous rational agents, regardless of any contingent differences, of gender, racial or ethnic identity, socio-economic class status, and so forth.  If Kant can pull this off, it will take him further in the direction of equality of rights than any previous philosopher considered here.  In order to establish a concept of right that is independent of empirical needs, desires, and interests, Kant argues for a single fundamental principle of all duty, which he calls the “categorical imperative,” because it tells us what, as persons, we ought to do, unconditionally.  It is a test we can use to help us rationally to distinguish between right and wrong; and he offers three different formulations of it which he considers three different ways of saying the same thing:  (a) the first is a formula of universalizability, that we should try to do only what we could reasonably will should become a universal law; (b) the second is a formula of respect for all persons, that we should try always to act in such a way as to respect all persons, ourselves and all others, as intrinsically valuable “ends in themselves” and never treat any persons merely as instrumental means to other ends; and (c) the third is a “principle of autonomy,” that we, as morally autonomous rational agents, should try to act in such a way that we could be reasonably legislating for a (hypothetical) moral republic of all persons.  For the dignity of all persons, rendering them intrinsically valuable and worthy of respect, is a function of their capacity for moral autonomy.  In his Metaphysics of Morals, Kant develops his ethical system, beyond this foundation, into a doctrine of right and a doctrine of virtue.  The former comprises strict duties of justice, while the latter comprises broader duties of merit.  Obviously, it is the former category, duties we owe all other persons, regardless of circumstances and consequences, that concerns us here, justice being a matter of strict right rather than one of meritorious virtue.  At the very end of his Metaphysics of Morals, Kant briefly discusses “divine justice,” whereby God legitimately punishes people for violating their duties (Ethical, pp. 2-3, 30-44, 36, 48, 158-161).

In his Metaphysical Elements of Justice, which constitutes the first part of his Metaphysics of Morals, Kant develops his theory of justice.  (His concept of Rechtslehre—literally, “doctrine of right”—has also been translated as “doctrine of justice” and “doctrine of law.”)  For Kant, justice is inextricably bound up with obligations with which we can rightly be required to comply. To say that we have duties of justice to other persons is to indicate that they have rights, against us, that we should perform those duties—so that duties of justice and rights are correlative.  Three conditions must be met in order that the concept of justice should apply:  (a) we must be dealing with external interpersonal behaviors; (b) it must relate to willed action and not merely to wishes, desires, and needs; and (c) the consequences intended are not morally relevant.  A person is not committing an injustice by considering stealing another’s property or in wanting to do so, but only by voluntarily taking action to appropriate it without permission; and the act is not justified no matter what good consequences may be intended.  According to Kant, there is only one innate human right possessed by all persons; that is the right freely to do what one wills, so long as that is “compatible with the freedom of everyone else in accordance with a universal law.”  Thus one person’s right freely to act cannot extend to infringing on the freedom of others or the violation of their rights.  This leads to Kant’s ultimate universal principle of justice, which is itself a categorical imperative:  “Every action is just [right] that in itself or in its maxim is such that the freedom of the will of each can coexist together with the freedom of everyone in accordance with a universal law.”  Although the use of coercive force against other persons involves an attempt to restrict their freedom, this is not necessarily unjust, if it is used to counteract their unjust abuse of freedom—for example, in self-defense or punishment or even war.  Kant approvingly invokes three ancient rules of justice:  (1) we should be honest in our dealings with others; (2) we should avoid being unjust towards others even if that requires our trying to avoid them altogether; and (3) if we cannot avoid associating with others, we should at least try to respect their rights (Justice, pp. 29, 38, 30-31, 37; see also Lectures, pp. 211-212).

Kant distinguishes between natural or private justice, on the one hand, and civil or public justice, on the other.  He has an intricate theory of property rights, which we can only touch upon here.  We can claim, in the name of justice, to have rights to (a) physical property, such as your car, (b) the performance of a particular deed by another person, such as the auto shop keeping its agreement to try to fix your car, and (c) certain characteristics of interpersonal relationships with those under our authority, such as obedient children and respectful servants.  Someone who steals your car or the auto mechanic who has agreed to fix it and then fails to try to do so is doing you an injustice.  Children, as developing but dependent persons, have a right to support and care from their parents; but, in turn, they owe their parents obedience while under their authority.  Children are not the property of their parents and must never be treated like things or objects; and, when they have become independent of their parents, they owe them nothing more than gratitude.  Similarly, a master must respect a servant as a person.  The servant may be under contract to serve the master, but that contract cannot be permanent or legitimately involve the giving up of the servant’s personhood (in other words, one cannot justifiably enter into slavery).  While the master has authority over the servant, that must never be viewed as ownership or involve abuse.  This all concerns private or natural justice, having to do with the securing of property rights.  Next let us next consider how Kant applies his theory of justice to the problem of crime and punishment, in the area of public or civil justice, involving protective, commutative, and distributive justice, the requirements of which can be legitimately enforced by civil society.  When a person commits a crime, that involves misusing freedom to infringe the freedom of others or to violate their rights.  Thus the criminal forfeits the right to freedom and can become a legitimate prisoner of the state.  Kant considers the rule that criminals should be punished for their crimes to be “a categorical imperative,” a matter of just “retribution” not to be denied or even mitigated for utilitarian reasons.  This extends to the ultimate punishment, the death penalty:  justice requires that murderers, the most heinous criminals, should suffer capital punishment, as no lesser penalty would be just.  A third application to consider here is that of war.  This is in the international part of public justice that Kant calls “the Law of Nations.”  He adopts a non-empirical version of the social contract theory, interpreting it not as a historical fact mysteriously generating obligations but rather as a hypothetical idea of what free and equal moral agents could reasonably agree to in the way of rules of justice.  Unlike Hobbes, he does not see this as a basis for all moral duty.  It does account for the obligation we have to the state and other citizens.  But states have duties to other states, so that there is an international law of nations.  Even though different states, in the absence of international law, are in a natural condition of a state of war, as Hobbes thought, he was wrong to think that, in that state, anything rightly goes and that there is no justice.  War is bad, and we should try to minimize the need for it, although Kant is not a pacifist and can justify it for purposes of self-defense.  Kant proposes an international “league of nations” to help provide for mutual “protection against external aggression” and, thus, to discourage it and reduce the need to go to war.  Still, when war cannot be avoided, it should be declared rather than launched by means of a sneak attack; secondly, there are legitimate limits that prohibit, for example, trying to exterminate or subjugate all members of the enemy society; third, when a war is over, the winning party cannot destroy the civil freedom of the losing parties, as by enslaving them; and, fourth, certain “rights of peace” must be assured and honored for all involved.  Thus the ultimate goal of international relations and of the league of nations should be the ideal of “perpetual peace” among different states that share our planet (Justice, pp. 41, 43, 91-95, 113, 136-141, 146, 151-158; for more on Kant’s version of the social contract theory, see Writings, pp. 73-85, and for more on his views on war and “perpetual peace,” see Writings, pp. 93-130).  Thus we see Kant applying his own theory of justice in three areas:  in the area of private law having to do with the securing of property rights, in the area of public law having to do with retributive punishment for crimes committed, and in the area of international justice concerned with war and peace.

What shall we critically say about this theory?  First, it argues for a sense of justice in terms of objective, non-arbitrary right—against, say, Hobbes and Hume.  Second, this sense of justice is of a piece with Kant’s categorical imperative, in that the rules of justice (e.g., regarding property rights, punishment, and war) are universalizable, designed to respect persons as intrinsically valuable, and conforming to the principle of autonomy.  Third, if Hume is correct in suggesting that we can never logically infer what ought to be from what actually is, then Kant’s is the only theory we have considered thus far that can pass the test.  To focus the issue, ask the question, why should we be just?  For Plato, this is the way to achieve the fulfillment of a well-ordered soul.  For Aristotle, the achievement and exercising of moral virtue is a necessary condition of human flourishing.  For Augustine and Aquinas, God’s eternal law requires that we, as God’s personal creatures, should be just, with our salvation at stake.  For Hobbes, practicing justice is required by enlightened self-interest.  For Hume, even though our being just may not benefit us directly all the time, it is conducive to public utility or the good of the society of which we are members.  But for each of these claims, we can ask, so what?  If any combination of these claims were to turn out to be correct, we could still legitimately ask why we should therefore be just.  Are we to assume that we ought to do whatever it takes to achieve a well-ordered soul or to flourish or to comply with God’s will or to serve our own self-interest or public utility?  Why?  Consider Kant’s answer:  we should try to be just because it’s the right thing to do and because it is our duty, as rational, moral agents, to try to do what is right.  Kant’s analysis of justice works well; and, given that, his applications to property rights, crime and punishment, and war and peace are also impressive.  Yet his theory is commonly rejected as too idealistic to be realistically applicable in the so-called “real world,” because it maintains that some things can be absolutely unjust and are, thus, categorically impermissible, regardless of likely consequences.  His theory as we have considered it here is a paradigmatic example of the view of justice being advocated in this article, as essentially requiring respect for persons as free, rational agents.  Yet Kant’s inflexibility in other points of application, such as in his absolute prohibition against lying to a would-be murderer in order to save innocent human life (Ethical, pp. 162-166), his idea that women and servants are merely “passive citizens” unfit to vote, and his categorical denial of any right to resistance or revolution against oppression (Justice, pp. 120, 124-128), is problematic here, inviting an alternative such as is represented by Mill’s utilitarianism.

b. Mill

Let us consider a bit of Karl Marx (and his collaborator Friedrich Engels) as a quick transition between Kant and Mill.  Kant represents the very sort of bourgeois conception of justice against which Marx and Engels protest in their call, in The Communist Manifesto, for a socialistic revolution.  Marx explains the ideal of socio-economic equality he advocates with the famous slogan that all should be required to contribute to society to the extent of their abilities and all should be allowed to receive from society in accordance with their needs.  John Stuart Mill, a nineteenth-century English philosopher, was aware of the call for a Communist revolution and advocated progressive liberal reform as an alternative path to political evolution.  Whereas Kant was the first great deontologist, Mill subscribed to the already established tradition of utilitarianism.  Although earlier British thinkers (including Hobbes and Hume) were proto-utilitarians, incorporating elements of the theory into their own worldviews, the movement, as such, is usually thought to stem from the publication of Jeremy Bentham’s Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation in 1789.  He there proposes the “principle of utility,” which he also later calls the “greatest happiness” principle, as the desirable basis for individual and collective decision-making:  “By the principle of utility is meant that principle which approves or disapproves of every action whatsoever, according to the tendency which it appears to have to augment or diminish the happiness of the party whose interest is in question.”  That single sentence establishes the ultimate criterion for utilitarian reasoning and the root of a great movement.  A famous lawyer named John Austin, under whom Mill studied, wrote a book of jurisprudence based on Bentham’s “principle of general utility.”  Mill’s father, James Mill, was a friend and disciple of Bentham and educated his only son also to be a utilitarian.  Near the end of his life, Mill observed that it was the closest thing to a religion in which his father raised him.  And, if he was not the founder of this secular religion, he clearly became its most effective evangelist.  In Utilitarianism, his own great essay in ethical theory, Mill gives his own statement of the principle of utility (again employing a curiously religious word):  “The creed which accepts as the foundation of morals, Utility, or the Greatest Happiness Principle, holds that actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness, wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness.”  He immediately proceeds to interpret human happiness and unhappiness (as Bentham had done) in hedonistic terms of pleasure and pain (Utilitarianism, pp. 33-34, 329, 257).  This presents the deceptive appearance of a remarkably simple rubric for practical judgment:  if an action generates an excess of pleasure over pain, that contributes to human happiness, which is our greatest good, making the action right; on the other hand, if an action generates an excess of pain over pleasure, that contributes to human unhappiness, which is our greatest evil, making the action wrong.  But what is deceptive about this is the notion that we can sufficiently anticipate future consequences to be able to predict where our actions will lead us.  (Notice, also, that unlike Kantian deontology, which makes what is right independent of good consequences, utilitarianism makes the former a function of the latter.)

Mill acknowledges that concern about a possible conflict between utility and justice has always been “one of the strongest obstacles” to the acceptance of utilitarianism.  If permanently enslaving a minority could produce overwhelming happiness for a majority (he was personally opposed to slavery as an unconscionable violation of human liberty), then, given that utility is the value that trumps all others, why shouldn’t the injustice of slavery be accepted as a (regrettably) necessary means to a socially desirable end, the former, however unfortunate, being thus justified?  Mill thinks that the key to solving this alleged problem is that of conceptual analysis, that if we properly understand what “utility” and “justice” are all about, we shall be able to see that no genuine conflict between them is possible.  We have already discerned what the former concept means and now need to elucidate the latter.  Mill lays out five dimensions of justice as we use the term:  (1) respecting others’ “legal rights” is considered just, while violating them is unjust; (2) respecting the “moral right” someone has to something is just, while violating it is unjust; (3) it is considered just to give a person what “he deserves” and unjust to deny it; (4) it is thought unjust to “break faith” with another, while keeping faith with others is just; and (5) in some circumstances, it is deemed unjust “to be partial” in one’s judgments and just to be impartial.  People commonly associate all of these with justice, and they do seem to represent legitimate aspects of the virtue.  (Interestingly, Mill rejects the idea “of equality” as essential to our understanding of justice, a stand which would be problematic for Marxists.)  As he seeks his own common denominator for these various dimensions of justice, he observes that justice always goes beyond generic right and wrong to involve what “some individual person can claim from us as his moral right.”  This entails the legitimate sense that anyone who has committed an injustice deserves to be punished somehow (which connects with Kant).  Mill thinks all this boils down to the idea that justice is a term “for certain moral requirements, which, regarded collectively, stand higher in the scale of social utility,” being more obligatory “than any others.”  But this means that justice, properly understood, is a name for the most important of “social utilities” (ibid., pp. 296-301, 305, 309, 320-321).  Therefore there purportedly cannot be any genuine conflict between utility and justice.  If there ever were circumstances in which slavery were truly useful to humanity, then presumably it would be just; the reason it is (typically) unjust is that it violates utility.  The main goal here is to reduce justice to social utility, in such a way as to rule out, by definition, any ultimate conflict between the two.  Thus, the social role played by our sense of justice is allegedly that it serves the common good.

Mill’s other great work is On Liberty, which provides us with a connecting link between this utilitarian theory and applications of it to particular social issues.  The problem Mill sets for himself here is where to draw a reasonable line between areas in which society can rightly proscribe behavior and those in which people should be allowed the freedom to do as they will.  When is it just to interfere with a person’s acting on personal choice?  To solve this problem, which is as relevant today as it was a century and a half ago, he proposes his “one very simple principle” of liberty, which he states in two slightly different ways:  (1) the “self-protection” version holds that people can only legitimately interfere with the freedom of action of others to protect themselves from them; (2) the “harm” version maintains that force can only be justifiably used against other members of community to prevent their harming others.  It is not acceptable to use power against others to stop them from hurting only themselves.  Mill candidly admits that this principle is reasonably feasible only with regard to mature, responsible members of civilized societies—not to children or to the insane or even necessarily to primitive peoples who cannot make informed judgments about their own true good.  He decisively renounces any appeal to abstract rights as a basis for this principle, basing it simply on “utility in the largest sense, grounded on the permanent interests of a man as a progressive being.”  Notice that this presupposes that we can distinguish between other-regarding behavior, which may be justifiably regulated, and purely self-regarding behavior, which may not be.  If that turns out to be a false distinction, then Mill’s theory may collapse.  At any rate, he articulates at least three areas of social life in which people’s liberty should be “absolute and unqualified”:  (a) that of freedom of thought and expression; (b) that of freedom of personal lifestyle; and (c) the freedom to associate with others of one’s choice, so long as it is for peaceful purposes.  He seems confident that utility will always require that freedom be protected in these areas (ibid., pp. 135-138).  In other words, on this liberal utilitarian view, it would always be unjust for an individual or a social group, in a civilized society, deliberately to interfere with a responsible, rational person’s actions in any combination of these areas.

Let us now see how Mill applies his utilitarian theory to three problems of justice that are still timely today.  First of all, the issue of punishment is one he considers in Utilitarianism, though his discussion is aimed at considering alternative accounts rather than conclusively saying what he himself thinks (we might also observe that, in this short passage, he attacks the social contract theory as a useless fiction) (ibid., pp. 311-313).  As a utilitarian, he favors the judicious use of punishment in order to deter criminal activity.  He believes in the utility/justice of self-defense and sees the right to punish as anchored in that.  In 1868, as an elected member of Parliament, he made a famous speech in the House of Commons supporting capital punishment on utilitarian grounds.  Although it is clear that he would like to be able to support a bill for its abolition, the lawful order of society, a necessary condition of societal well-being, requires this means of deterring the most heinous crimes, such as aggravated murder.  He even thinks it a quicker, more humane punishment than incarcerating someone behind bars for the rest of his life.  Mill does worry about the possibility of executing an innocent person, but he thinks a carefully managed legal system can render this danger “extremely rare” (“Punishment,” pp. 266-272).  Thus his utilitarian theory provides him with a basis for supporting capital punishment as morally justifiable.  A second famous application of his utilitarian theory of justice Mill makes is to the issue of equal opportunity for women.  In the very first paragraph of The Subjection of Women, Mill maintains that “the principle which regulates the existing social relations between the two sexes—the legal subordination of one sex to the other—is wrong in itself, and now one of the chief hindrances to human improvement; and that it ought to be replaced by a principle of perfect equality, admitting no power or privilege on the one side, nor disability on the other.”  So he does not call for the preferential treatment of “affirmative action” but only for equal opportunity.  Unlike contemporary feminists, he does not appeal to women’s human rights as his rationale, but only to the maximization of “human happiness” and the liberty “that makes life valuable” (Subjection, pp. 1, 26, 101).  Here, again, we have an issue of social justice to which his utilitarian theory is applied, generating liberal conclusions.  Our third issue of application is that of international non-intervention.  Mill’s general principle here is that using force against others is prima facie unjust. Although defensive wars can be justifiable, aggressive ones are not.  It can be justifiable to go to war without being attacked or directly threatened with an attack, for example, to help civilize a barbarian society, which, as such, allegedly has no rights.  It can be justifiable to save a subjected population from the oppression of a despotic government (“Non-Intervention,” pp. 376-383).  All of this is presumably a function of utilitarian welfare.  Once more, a still timely moral issue has been addressed using the utilitarian theory of justice.

These applications all plausibly utilize the values and reasoning of utilitarianism, which, by its very nature, must be consequentialist.  From that perspective, the deterrence approach to punishment, including capital punishment, seems appropriate, as do Mill’s call for equal opportunity for women and his measured position on international interventionism.  Surely, the premium he places on human happiness is admirable, as is his universal perspective, which views all humans as counting.  The problem is in his assumptions that all values are relative to consequences, that human happiness is the ultimate good, and that this reduces to the maximization of pleasure and the minimization of pain.  The upshot of this position is that, in principle, nothing can  be categorically forbidden, that, given sufficiently desirable ends, any means necessary to achieve them can be justified.  If we really believe that there can be no genuine conflict between justice and utility because the former is merely the most important part of the latter, then the rules of justice are reducible to calculations regarding what is generally conducive to the greatest happiness for the greatest number of people—mere inductive generalizations which must permit of exceptions; at least Mill’s ambiguity leaves him open to this interpretation.  There would seem to be a tension in Mill’s thought:  on the one hand, he wants to respect the liberty of all (civilized) responsible persons as rational agents; but, on the other hand, his commitment to utilitarianism would seem to subordinate that respect to the greatest good for the greatest number of people, allowing for the possibility of sacrificing the interests of the few to those of the many.

5. Contemporary Philosophers

From its founding, American political thought had an enduring focus on justice.  The Preamble to the American Constitution says that one of its primary goals is to “establish justice.”  Founding father James Madison, in 1788, wrote in The Federalist Papers that justice should be the goal of all government and of all civil society, that people are willing to risk even liberty in its pursuit.  American schoolchildren are made to memorize and recite a Pledge of Allegiance that ends with the words “with liberty and justice for all.”  So justice is an abiding American ideal.  We shall now consider how one of America’s greatest philosophers, John Rawls, addresses this ideal.  We should notice how he places a greater emphasis on equality than do most of his European predecessors—perhaps reflecting the conviction of the American Declaration of Independence that “all men are created equal.”  (This greater emphasis may reflect the influence of Marx, whom he occasionally mentions.)  After considering the formidable contributions of Rawls to justice theory and some of its applications, we shall conclude this survey with a brief treatment of several post-Rawlsian alternatives.  A key focus that will distinguish this section from previous ones is the effort to achieve a conception of justice that strikes a reasonable balance between liberty and equality.

a. Rawls

Rawls burst into prominence in 1958 with the publication of his game-changing paper, “Justice as Fairness.”  Though it was not his first important publication, it revived the social contract theory that had been languishing in the wake of Hume’s critique and its denigration by utilitarians and pragmatists, though it was a Kantian version of it that Rawls advocated.  This led to a greatly developed book version, A Theory of Justice, published in 1971, arguably the most important book of American philosophy published in the second half of the last century.  Rawls makes it clear that his theory, which he calls “justice as fairness,” assumes a Kantian view of persons as “free and equal,” morally autonomous, rational agents, who are not necessarily egoists.  He also makes it clear early on that he means to present his theory as a preferable alternative to that of utilitarians.  He asks us to imagine persons in a hypothetical “initial situation” which he calls “the original position” (corresponding to the “state of nature” or “natural condition” of Hobbes, but clearly not presented as any sort of historical or pre-historical fact).  This is strikingly characterized by what Rawls calls “the veil of ignorance,” a device designed to minimize the influence of selfish bias in attempting to determine what would be just.  If you must decide on what sort of society you could commit yourself to accepting as a permanent member and were not allowed to factor in specific knowledge about yourself—such as your gender, race, ethnic identity, level of intelligence, physical strength, quickness and stamina, and so forth—then you would presumably exercise the rational choice to make the society as fair for everyone as possible, lest you find yourself at the bottom of that society for the rest of your life.  In such a “purely hypothetical” situation, Rawls believes that we would rationally adopt two basic principles of justice for our society:  “the first requires equality in the assignment of basic rights and duties, while the second holds that social and economic inequalities, for example inequalities of wealth and authority, are just only if they result in compensating benefits for everyone, and in particular for the least advantaged members of society.”  Here we see Rawls conceiving of justice, the primary social virtue, as requiring equal basic liberties for all citizens and a presumption of equality even regarding socio-economic goods.  He emphasizes the point that these principles rule out as unjust the utilitarian justification of disadvantages for some on account of greater advantages for others, since that would be rationally unacceptable to one operating under the veil of ignorance.  Like Kant, Rawls is opposed to the teleological or consequentialist gambit of defining the right (including the just) in terms of “maximizing the good”; he rather, like Kant, the deontologist, is committed to a “priority of the right over the good.”  Justice is not reducible to utility or pragmatic desirability.  We should notice that the first principle of justice, which requires maximum equality of rights and duties for all members of society, is prior in “serial or lexical order” to the second, which specifies how socio-economic inequalities can be justified (Theory, pp. 12-26, 31, 42-43).  Again, this is anti-utilitarian, in that no increase in socio-economic benefits for anyone can ever justify anything less than maximum equality of rights and duties for all.  Thus, for example, if enslaving a few members of society generated vastly more benefits for the majority than liabilities for them, such a bargain would be categorically ruled out as unjust.

Rawls proceeds to develop his articulation of these two principles of justice more carefully.  He reformulates the first one in terms of maximum equal liberty, writing that “each person is to have an equal right to the most extensive basic liberty compatible with a similar liberty for others.”  The basic liberties intended concern such civil rights as are protected in our Constitution—free speech, freedom of assembly, freedom of conscience, the right to private property, the rights to vote and hold public office, freedom from arbitrary arrest and seizure, etc.  The lexical priority of this first principle requires that it be categorical in that the only justification for limiting any basic liberties would be to enhance other basic liberties; for example, it might be just to limit free access of the press to a sensational legal proceeding in order to protect the right of the accused to a fair trial.  Rawls restates his second principle to maintain that “social and economic inequalities are to be arranged so that they are both (a) reasonably expected to be to everyone’s advantage, and (b) attached to positions and offices open to all.”  Thus socio-economic inequalities can be justified, but only if both conditions are met.  The first condition (a) is “the difference principle” and takes seriously the idea that every socio-economic difference separating one member of society from others must be beneficial to all, including the person ranked lowest.  The second condition is one of “fair equality of opportunity,” in that socio-economic advantages must be connected to positions to which all members of society could have access.  For example, the office of the presidency has attached to it greater social prestige and income than is available to most of us.  Is that just?  It can be, assuming that all of us, as citizens, could achieve that office with its compensations and that even those of us at or near the bottom of the socio-economic scale benefit from intelligent, talented people accepting the awesome responsibilities of that office.  Just as the first principle must be lexically prior to the second, Rawls also maintains that “fair opportunity is prior to the difference principle.”  Thus, if we have to choose between equal opportunity for all and socio-economically benefiting “the least advantaged” members of society, the former has priority over the latter.  Most of us today might be readily sympathetic to the first principle and the equal opportunity condition, while finding the difference principle to be objectionably egalitarian, to the point of threatening incentives to contribute more than is required.  Rawls does consider a “mixed conception” of justice that most of us would regard as more attractive “arising when the principle of average utility constrained by a certain social minimum is substituted for the difference principle, everything else remaining unchanged.”  But there would be a problem of fairly agreeing on that acceptable social minimum, and it would change with shifting contingent circumstances.  It is curious that his own theory of “justice as fairness” gets attacked by socialists such as Nielsen (whom we shall consider) for sacrificing equality for the sake of liberty and by libertarians such as Nozick (whom we shall also consider) for giving up too much liberty for the sake of equality.  Rawls briefly suggests that his theory of justice as fairness might be applied to international relations, in general, and to just war theory, in particular (ibid., pp. 60-65, 75, 83, 302-303, 316, 378).

Rawls applies his theory of justice to the domestic issue of civil disobedience.  No society is perfectly just.  A generally or “nearly just society” can have unjust laws, in which case its citizens may or may not have a duty to comply with them, depending on how severely unjust they are.  If the severity of the injustice is not great, then respect for democratic majority rule might morally dictate compliance.  Otherwise, citizens can feel a moral obligation to engage in civil disobedience, which Rawls defines as “a public, nonviolent, conscientious yet political act contrary to law usually done with the aim of bringing about a change in the law or policies of the government.”  Certain conditions must be met in order that an act of civil disobedience be justified:  (1) it should normally address violations of equal civil liberties (the first principle of justice) and/or of “fair equality of opportunity” (the second part of the second principle), with violations of the difference principle (the first part of the second principle) being murkier and, thus, harder to justify; (2) the act of civil disobedience should come only after appeals to the political majority have been reasonably tried and failed; (3) it must seem likely to accomplish more good than harm for the social order.  Yet, even if all three of these conditions seem to be met and the disobedient action seems right, there remains the practical question of whether it would be “wise or prudent,” under the circumstances, to engage in the act of civil disobedience.  Ultimately, every individual must decide for himself or herself whether such action is morally and prudentially justifiable or not as reasonably and responsibly as possible.  The acts of civil disobedience of Martin Luther King (to whom Rawls refers in a footnote) seem to have met all the conditions, to have been done in the name of justice, and to have been morally justified (ibid., pp. 350-357, 363-367, 372-376, 389-390, 364n).

Rawls’s second book was Political Liberalism.  Here he works out how a just political conception might develop a workable “overlapping consensus” despite the challenges to social union posed by a pluralism of “reasonable comprehensive doctrines.”  This, of course, calls for some explanation.  A just society must protect basic liberties equally for all of its members, including freedom of thought and its necessary condition, freedom of expression.  But, in a free society that protects these basic liberties, a pluralism of views and values is likely to develop, such that people can seriously disagree about matters they hold dear.  They will develop their own “comprehensive doctrines,” or systems of beliefs that may govern all significant aspects of their lives.  These may be religious (like Christianity) or philosophical (like Kantianism) or moral (like utilitarian).  Yet a variety of potentially conflicting comprehensive doctrines may be such that all are reasonable.  In such a case, social unity requires respect for and tolerance of other sets of beliefs.  It would be unjust deliberately to suppress reasonable comprehensive doctrines merely because they are different from our own.  The problem of political liberalism nowadays is how we can establish “a stable and just society whose free and equal citizens are deeply divided by conflicting and even incommensurable religious, philosophical, and moral doctrines.”  What is needed is a shared “political conception of justice” that is neutral regarding competing comprehensive doctrines.  This could allow for “an overlapping consensus of reasonable comprehensive doctrines,” such that tolerance and mutual respect are operative even among those committed to incompatible views and values, so long as they are reasonable (Liberalism, pp. 291-292, 340-342, 145, xviii, 13, 152n., 59-60, 133, 154-155, 144, 134).  Thus, for example, a Christian Kantian and an atheistic utilitarian, while sincerely disagreeing on many ethical principles, philosophical ideas, and religious beliefs, can unite in mutually accepting, for instance, the American Constitution as properly binding on all of us equally.  This agreement will enable them mutually to participate in social cooperation, the terms of which are fair and reciprocal and which can contribute to the reasonable good of the entire society.

Near the end of his life, Rawls published The Law of Peoples, in which he tried to apply his theory of justice to international relations.  Given that not all societies act justly and that societies have a right to defend themselves against aggressive violent force, there can be a right to go to war (jus ad bellum).  Yet even then, not all is fair in war, and rules of just warfare (jus in bello) should be observed:  (1) the goal must be a “just and lasting peace”; (2) it must be waged in defense of freedom and security from aggression; (3) reasonable attempts must be made not to attack innocent non-combatants; (4) the human rights of enemies (for example, against being tortured) must be respected; (5) attempts should be made to establish peaceful relations; and (6) practical tactics must always remain within the parameters of moral principles.  After hostilities have ceased, just conquerors must treat their conquered former enemies with respect—not, for example, enslaving them or denying them civil liberties.  Rawls adds a very controversial “supreme emergency exemption” in relation to the third rule—when a relatively just society’s very survival is in desperate peril, its attacking enemy civilian populations, as by bombing cities, can be justifiable.  More generally, Rawls applies his theory of justice to international relations, generating eight rules regarding how the people of other societies must be treated.  While we do not have time to explore them all here, the last one is sufficiently provocative to be worth our considering:  “Peoples have a duty to assist other peoples living under unfavorable conditions that prevent their having a just or decent political and social regime.”  This, of course, goes beyond not exploiting, cheating, manipulating, deceiving, and interfering with others to a positive duty of trying to help them, at the cost of time, money, and other resources.  Justice demands that we try to assist what Rawls calls “burdened societies,” so that doing so is not morally supererogatory.  What is most interesting here is what Rawls refuses to say.  While different peoples, internationally speaking, might be imagined in an original position under the veil of ignorance, and Rawls would favor encouraging equal liberties and opportunities for all, he refuses to apply the difference principle globally in such a way as to indicate that justice requires a massive redistribution of wealth from richer to poorer societies (Peoples, pp. 94-96, 98-99, 37, 106, 114-117).

From a critical perspective, Rawls’s theory of civil disobedience is excellent, as are his theory of political liberalism and his version of the just war theory, except for that “supreme emergency exemption,” which uncharacteristically tries to make right a function of teleological good.  His views on international aid seem so well worked out that, ironically, they call into question part of his general theory of justice itself.  It does not seem plausible that the difference principle should apply intrasocietally but not internationally.  The problem may be with the difference principle itself.  It is not at all clear that rational agents in a hypothetical original position would adopt such an egalitarian principle.  The veil of ignorance leading to this controversial principle can itself be questioned as artificial and unrealistic; one might object that, far from being methodologically neutral, it sets up a bias (towards, for example, being risk-aversive) that renders Rawls’s own favored principles of justice almost a foregone conclusion.  Indeed, the “mixed conception” that Rawls himself considers and rejects seems more plausible and more universally applicable—keeping the first principle and the second part of the second but replacing the difference principle with one of average utility, constrained by some social minimum, adjustable with changing circumstances.  Thus we could satisfactorily specify the requirements of an essentially Kantian conception of justice, as requiring respect for the dignity of all persons as free and equal, rational moral agents.  While less egalitarian than what Rawls offers, it might prove an attractive alternative.  To what extent should liberty be constrained by equality in a just society?  This is a central issue that divides him from many post-Rawlsians, to a few of whom we now briefly turn.

b. Post-Rawls

Rawls’s monumental work on justice theory revitalized political philosophy in the United States and other English-speaking countries.  In this final subsection, we shall briefly survey some of the most important recent attempts to provide preferable alternatives to Rawls’s conception of justice.  They will represent six different approaches.  We shall consider, in succession, (1) the libertarian approach of Robert Nozick, (2) the socialistic one of Kai Nielsen, (3) the communitarian one of Michael Sandel, (4) the globalist one of Thomas Pogge, (5) the feminist one of Martha Nussbaum, and (6) the rights-based one of Michael Boylan.  As this is merely a quick survey, we shall not delve much into the details of their theories (limiting ourselves to a single work by each) or explore their applications or do much in the way of a critique of them.  But the point will be to get a sense of several recent approaches to developing views of justice in the wake of Rawls.

(1)    Nozick

Nozick (a departmental colleague of Rawls at Harvard) was one of the first and remains one of the most famous critics of Rawls’s liberal theory of justice.  Both are fundamentally committed to individual liberty.  But as a libertarian, Nozick is opposed to compromising individual liberty in order to promote socio-economic equality and advocates a “minimal state” as the only sort that can be socially just.  In Anarchy, State, and Utopia (1974), especially in its famous chapter on “Distributive Justice,” while praising Rawls’s first book as the most important “work in political and moral philosophy” since that of Mill, Nozick  argues for what he calls an “entitlement conception of justice” in terms of three principles of just holdings.  First, anyone who justly acquires any holding is rightly entitled to keep and use it.  Second, anyone who acquires any holding by means of a just transfer of property is rightly entitled to keep and use it.  It is only through some combination of these two approaches that anyone is rightly entitled to any holding.  But some people acquire holdings unjustly—e.g., by theft or fraud or force—so that there are illegitimate holdings.  So, third, justice can require the rectification of unjust past acquisitions.  These three principles of just holdings—“the principle of acquisition of holdings, the principle of transfer of holdings, and the principle of rectification of the violations of the first two principles”—constitute the core of Nozick’s libertarian entitlement theory of justice.  People should be entitled to use their own property as they see fit, so long as they are entitled to it.  On this view, any pattern of distribution, such as Rawls’s difference principle, that would force people to give up any holdings to which they are entitled in order to give it to someone else (i.e., a redistribution of wealth) is unjust.  Thus, for Nozick, any state, such as ours or one Rawls would favor, that is “more extensive” than a minimal state and redistributes wealth by taxing those who are relatively well off to benefit the disadvantaged necessarily “violates people’s rights” (State, pp. 149, 183, 230, 150-153, 230-231, 149).

(2)    Nielsen

Nielsen, as a socialist (against both Rawls and Nozick) considers equality to be a more fundamental ideal than individual liberty; this is more in keeping with Marxism than with the liberal/libertarian tradition that has largely stemmed from Locke.  (Whereas capitalism supports the ownership and control of the means of producing and distribution material goods by private capital or wealth, socialism holds that they should be owned and controlled by society as a whole.)  If Nozick accuses Rawls of going too far in requiring a redistribution of wealth, Nielsen criticizes him for favoring individual liberty at the expense of social equality.  In direct contrast to Rawls’s two liberal principles of justice, in “Radical Egalitarian Justice:  Justice as Equality,” Nielsen proposes his own two socialistic principles constituting the core of his “egalitarian conception of justice.”  In his first principle, he calls for “equal basic liberties and opportunities” (rather than for merely “equal basic liberties”), including the opportunities “for meaningful work, for self-determination, and political participation,” which he considers important to promote “equal moral autonomy and equal self-respect.”  Also (unlike Rawls) he does not claim any lexical priority for either principle over the other.  His sharper departure from Rawls can be found in his second principle, which is to replace the difference principle that allegedly justified socio-economic inequality.  After specifying a few qualifications, it calls for “the income and wealth” of society “to be so divided that each person will have a right to an equal share” and for the burdens of society “also to be equally shared, subject, of course, to limitations by differing abilities and differing situations.”  He argues that his own second principle would better promote “equal self-respect and equal moral autonomy” among the members of society.  Thus we might eliminate social stratification and class exploitation, in accordance with the ideals of Marxist humanism (“Equality,” pp. 209, 211-213, 222-225).

(3)    Sandel

Sandel, as a communitarian, argues (against Rawls and Nozick) that the well-being of a community takes precedence over individual liberty and (against Nielsen) over the socio-economic welfare of its members.  While acknowledging that Rawls is not so “narrowly individualistic” as to rule out the value of building social community, in Liberalism and the Limits of Justice, he maintains that the individualism of persons in the original position is such that “a sense of community” is not a basic “constituent of their identify as such,” so that community is bound to remain secondary and derivative in the Rawlsian theory.  To deny that community values help constitute one’s personal identity is to render impossible any preexisting interpersonal good from which a sense of right can be derived.  Thus, for Sandel, Rawls’s myopic theory of human nature gives him no basis for any pre-political natural rights.  So his conception of justice based on this impoverished view must fail to reflect “the shared self-understandings” of who they are as members of community that must undergird the basic structure of political society.  Through the interpersonal relationships of community, we establish “more or less enduring attachments and commitments” that help define who we are, as well as the values that will help characterize our sense of justice as a common good that cannot be properly understood by individuals detached from community.  Thus justice must determine what is right as serving the goods we embrace in a social context—“as members of this family or community or nation or people, as bearers of this history, as sons and daughters of that revolution, as citizens of this republic” rather than as abstract individuals (Limits, pp. 66, 60-65, 87, 150, 172-174, 179, 183, 179).

(4)    Pogge

Pogge develops a