Category Archives: Ethics

Thomas Hobbes: Moral and Political Philosophy

hobbesThe English philosopher Thomas Hobbes (1588-1679) is best known for his political thought, and deservedly so. His vision of the world is strikingly original and still relevant to contemporary politics. His main concern is the problem of social and political order: how human beings can live together in peace and avoid the danger and fear of civil conflict. He poses stark alternatives: we should give our obedience to an unaccountable sovereign (a person or group empowered to decide every social and political issue). Otherwise what awaits us is a "state of nature" that closely resembles civil war – a situation of universal insecurity, where all have reason to fear violent death and where rewarding human cooperation is all but impossible.

One controversy has dominated interpretations of Hobbes. Does he see human beings as purely self-interested or egoistic? Several passages support such a reading, leading some to think that his political conclusions can be avoided if we adopt a more realistic picture of human nature. However, most scholars now accept that Hobbes himself had a much more complex view of human motivation. A major theme below will be why the problems he poses cannot be avoided simply by taking a less "selfish" view of human nature.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Life and Times
  3. Two Intellectual Influences
  4. Ethics and Human Nature
    1. Materialism Versus Self-Knowledge
    2. The Poverty of Human Judgment and our Need for Science
    3. Motivation
    4. Political Philosophy
  5. The Natural Condition of Mankind
    1. The Laws of Nature and the Social Contract
    2. Why Should we Obey the Sovereign?
    3. Life Under the Sovereign
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Hobbes is the founding father of modern political philosophy. Directly or indirectly, he has set the terms of debate about the fundamentals of political life right into our own times. Few have liked his thesis, that the problems of political life mean that a society should accept an unaccountable sovereign as its sole political authority. Nonetheless, we still live in the world that Hobbes addressed head on: a world where human authority is something that requires justification, and is automatically accepted by few; a world where social and political inequality also appears questionable; and a world where religious authority faces significant dispute. We can put the matter in terms of the concern with equality and rights that Hobbes's thought heralded: we live in a world where all human beings are supposed to have rights, that is, moral claims that protect their basic interests. But what or who determines what those rights are? And who will enforce them? In other words, who will exercise the most important political powers, when the basic assumption is that we all share the same entitlements?

We can see Hobbes's importance if we briefly compare him with the most famous political thinkers before and after him. A century before, Nicolo Machiavelli had emphasized the harsh realities of power, as well as recalling ancient Roman experiences of political freedom. Machiavelli appears as the first modern political thinker, because like Hobbes he was no longer prepared to talk about politics in terms set by religious faith (indeed, he was still more offensive than Hobbes to many orthodox believers), instead, he looked upon politics as a secular discipline divorced from theology. But unlike Hobbes, Machiavelli offers us no comprehensive philosophy: we have to reconstruct his views on the importance and nature of freedom; it remains uncertain which, if any, principles Machiavelli draws on in his apparent praise of amoral power politics.

Writing a few years after Hobbes, John Locke had definitely accepted the terms of debate Hobbes had laid down: how can human beings live together, when religious or traditional justifications of authority are no longer effective or persuasive? How is political authority justified and how far does it extend? In particular, are our political rulers properly as unlimited in their powers as Hobbes had suggested? And if they are not, what system of politics will ensure that they do not overstep the mark, do not trespass on the rights of their subjects?

So, in assessing Hobbes's political philosophy, our guiding questions can be: What did Hobbes write that was so important? How was he able to set out a way of thinking about politics and power that remains decisive nearly four centuries afterwards? We can get some clues to this second question if we look at Hobbes's life and times.

2. Life and Times

Hobbes's biography is dominated by the political events in England and Scotland during his long life. Born in 1588, the year the Spanish Armada made its ill-fated attempt to invade England, he lived to the exceptional age of 91, dying in 1679. He was not born to power or wealth or influence: the son of a disgraced village vicar, he was lucky that his uncle was wealthy enough to provide for his education and that his intellectual talents were soon recognized and developed (through thorough training in the classics of Latin and Greek). Those intellectual abilities, and his uncle's support, brought him to university at Oxford. And these in turn - together with a good deal of common sense and personal maturity - won him a place tutoring the son of an important noble family, the Cavendishes. This meant that Hobbes entered circles where the activities of the King, of Members of Parliament, and of other wealthy landowners were known and discussed, and indeed influenced. Thus intellectual and practical ability brought Hobbes to a place close to power - later he would even be math tutor to the future King Charles II. Although this never made Hobbes powerful, it meant he was acquainted with and indeed vulnerable to those who were. As the scene was being set for the Civil Wars of 1642-46 and 1648-51 - wars that would lead to the King being executed and a republic being declared - Hobbes felt forced to leave the country for his personal safety, and lived in France from 1640 to 1651. Even after the monarchy had been restored in 1660, Hobbes's security was not always certain: powerful religious figures, critical of his writings, made moves in Parliament that apparently led Hobbes to burn some of his papers for fear of prosecution.

Thus Hobbes lived in a time of upheaval, sharper than any England has since known. This turmoil had many aspects and causes, political and religious, military and economic. England stood divided against itself in several ways. The rich and powerful were divided in their support for the King, especially concerning the monarch's powers of taxation. Parliament was similarly divided concerning its own powers vis-à-vis the King. Society was divided religiously, economically, and by region. Inequalities in wealth were huge, and the upheavals of the Civil Wars saw the emergence of astonishingly radical religious and political sects. (For instance, "the Levellers" called for much greater equality in terms of wealth and political rights; "the Diggers," more radical still, fought for the abolition of wage labor.) Civil war meant that the country became militarily divided. And all these divisions cut across one another: for example, the army of the republican challenger, Cromwell, was the main home of the Levellers, yet Cromwell in turn would act to destroy their power within the army's ranks. In addition, England’s recent union with Scotland was fragile at best, and was almost destroyed by King Charles I's attempts to impose consistency in religious practices. We shall see that Hobbes's greatest fear was social and political chaos - and he had ample opportunity both to observe it and to suffer its effects.

Although social and political turmoil affected Hobbes's life and shaped his thought, it never hampered his intellectual development. His early position as a tutor gave him the scope to read, write and publish (a brilliant translation of the Greek writer Thucydides appeared in 1629), and brought him into contact with notable English intellectuals such as Francis Bacon. His self-imposed exile in France, along with his emerging reputation as a scientist and thinker, brought him into contact with major European intellectual figures of his time, leading to exchange and controversy with figures such as Descartes, Mersenne and Gassendi. Intensely disputatious, Hobbes repeatedly embroiled himself in prolonged arguments with clerics, mathematicians, scientists and philosophers - sometimes to the cost of his intellectual reputation. (For instance, he argued repeatedly that it is possible to "square the circle" - no accident that the phrase is now proverbial for a problem that cannot be solved!) His writing was as undaunted by age and ill health as it was by the events of his times. Though his health slowly failed - from about sixty, he began to suffer "shaking palsy," probably Parkinson’s disease, which steadily worsened - even in his eighties he continued to dictate his thoughts to a secretary, and to defend his quarter in various controversies.

Hobbes gained a reputation in many fields. He was known as a scientist (especially in optics), as a mathematician (especially in geometry), as a translator of the classics, as a writer on law, as a disputant in metaphysics and epistemology; not least, he became notorious for his writings and disputes on religious questions. But it is for his writings on morality and politics that he has, rightly, been most remembered. Without these, scholars might remember Hobbes as an interesting intellectual of the seventeenth century; but few philosophers would even recognize his name.

What are the writings that earned Hobbes his philosophical fame? The first was entitled The Elements of Law (1640); this was Hobbes's attempt to provide arguments supporting the King against his challengers.De Cive [On the Citizen] (1642) has much in common with Elements, and offers a clear, concise statement of Hobbes's moral and political philosophy. His most famous work is Leviathan, a classic of English prose (1651; a slightly altered Latin edition appeared in 1668). Leviathan expands on the argument of De Cive, mostly in terms of its huge second half that deals with questions of religion. Other important works include: De Corpore [On the Body] (1655), which deals with questions of metaphysics;De Homine [On Man] (1657); and Behemoth (published 1682, though written rather earlier), in which Hobbes gives his account of England's Civil Wars. But to understand the essentials of Hobbes’s ideas and system, one can rely on De Cive and Leviathan. It is also worth noting that, although Leviathan is more famous and more often read, De Cive actually gives a much more straightforward account of Hobbes's ideas. Readers whose main interest is in those ideas may wish to skip the next section and go straight to ethics and human nature.

3. Two Intellectual Influences

As well as the political background just stressed, two influences are extremely marked in Hobbes's work. The first is a reaction against religious authority as it had been known, and especially against the scholastic philosophy that accepted and defended such authority. The second is a deep admiration for (and involvement in) the emerging scientific method, alongside an admiration for a much older discipline, geometry. Both influences affected how Hobbes expressed his moral and political ideas. In some areas it's also clear that they significantly affected the ideas themselves.

Hobbes's contempt for scholastic philosophy is boundless. Leviathan and other works are littered with references to the "frequency of insignificant speech" in the speculations of the scholastics, with their combinations of Christian theology and Aristotelian metaphysics. Hobbes's reaction, apart from much savage and sparkling sarcasm, is twofold. In the first place, he makes very strong claims about the proper relation between religion and politics. He was not (as many have charged) an atheist, but he was deadly serious in insisting that theological disputes should be kept out of politics. (He also adopts a strongly materialist metaphysics, that - as his critics were quick to charge - makes it difficult to account for God's existence as a spiritual entity.) For Hobbes, the sovereign should determine the proper forms of religious worship, and citizens never have duties to God that override their duty to obey political authority. Second, this reaction against scholasticism shapes the presentation of Hobbes's own ideas. He insists that terms be clearly defined and relate to actual concrete experiences - part of his empiricism. (Many early sections of Leviathan read rather like a dictionary.) Commentators debate how seriously to take Hobbes's stress on the importance of definition, and whether it embodies a definite philosophical doctrine. What is certain, and more important from the point of view of his moral and political thought, is that he tries extremely hard to avoid any metaphysical categories that don't relate to physical realities (especially the mechanical realities of matter and motion). Commentators further disagree whether Hobbes's often mechanical sounding definitions of human nature and human behavior are actually important in shaping his moral and political ideas - see Materialism versus self-knowledge below.

Hobbes's determination to avoid the "insignificant" (that is, meaningless) speech of the scholastics also overlaps with his admiration for the emerging physical sciences and for geometry. His admiration is not so much for the emerging method of experimental science, but rather for deductive science - science that deduces the workings of things from basic first principles and from true definitions of the basic elements. Hobbes therefore approves a mechanistic view of science and knowledge, one that models itself very much on the clarity and deductive power exhibited in proofs in geometry. It is fair to say that this a priori account of science has found little favor after Hobbes's time. It looks rather like a dead-end on the way to the modern idea of science based on patient observation, theory-building and experiment. Nonetheless, it certainly provided Hobbes with a method that he follows in setting out his ideas about human nature and politics. As presented in Leviathan, especially, Hobbes seems to build from first elements of human perception and reasoning, up to a picture of human motivation and action, to a deduction of the possible forms of political relations and their relative desirability. Once more, it can be disputed whether this method is significant in shaping those ideas, or merely provides Hobbes with a distinctive way of presenting them.

4. Ethics and Human Nature

Hobbes's moral thought is difficult to disentangle from his politics. On his view, what we ought to do depends greatly on the situation in which we find ourselves. Where political authority is lacking (as in his famous natural condition of mankind), our fundamental right seems to be to save our skins, by whatever means we think fit. Where political authority exists, our duty seems to be quite straightforward: to obey those in power.

But we can usefully separate the ethics from the politics if we follow Hobbes's own division. For him ethics is concerned with human nature, while political philosophy deals with what happens when human beings interact. What, then, is Hobbes's view of human nature?

a. Materialism Versus Self-Knowledge

Reading the opening chapters of Leviathan is a confusing business, and the reason for this is already apparent in Hobbes's very short "Introduction." He begins by telling us that the human body is like a machine, and that political organization ("the commonwealth") is like an artificial human being. He ends by saying that the truth of his ideas can be gauged only by self-examination, by looking into our selves to adjudge our characteristic thoughts and passions, which form the basis of all human action. But what is the relationship between these two very different claims? For obviously when we look into our selves we do not see mechanical pushes and pulls. This mystery is hardly answered by Hobbes's method in the opening chapters, where he persists in talking about all manner of psychological phenomena - from emotions to thoughts to whole trains of reasoning – as products of mechanical interactions. (As to what he will say about successful political organization, the resemblance between the commonwealth and a functioning human being is slim indeed. Hobbes's only real point seems to be that there should be a "head" that decides most of the important things that the "body" does.)

Most commentators now agree with an argument made in the 1960's by the political philosopher Leo Strauss. Hobbes draws on his notion of a mechanistic science, that works deductively from first principles, in setting out his ideas about human nature. Science provides him with a distinctive method and some memorable metaphors and similes. What it does not provide - nor could it, given the rudimentary state of physiology and psychology in Hobbes's day - are any decisive or substantive ideas about what human nature really is. Those ideas may have come, as Hobbes also claims, from self-examination. In all likelihood, they actually derived from his reflection on contemporary events and his reading of classics of political history such as Thucydides.

This is not to say that we should ignore Hobbes's ideas on human nature - far from it. But it does mean we should not be misled by scientific imagery that stems from an in fact non-existent science (and also, to some extent, from an unproven and uncertain metaphysics). The point is important mainly when it comes to a central interpretative point in Hobbes's work: whether or not he thinks of human beings as mechanical objects, programmed as it were to pursue their self-interest. Some have suggested that Hobbes's mechanical world-view leaves no room for the influence of moral ideas, that he thinks the only effective influence on our behavior will be incentives of pleasure and pain. But while it is true that Hobbes sometimes says things like this, we should be clear that the ideas fit together only in a metaphorical way. For example, there's no reason why moral ideas shouldn’t "get into" the mechanisms that drive us round (like so many clock-work dolls perhaps?). Likewise, there's no reason why pursuing pleasure and pain should work in our self-interest. (What self-interest is depends on the time-scale we adopt, and how effectively we might achieve this goal also depends on our insight into what harms and benefits us). If we want to know what drives human beings, on Hobbes's view, we must read carefully all he says about this, as well as what he needs to assume if the rest of his thought is to make sense. The mechanistic metaphor is something of a red herring and, in the end, probably less useful than his other starting point inLeviathan, the Delphic epithet: nosce teipsum, "know thyself."

b. The Poverty of Human Judgment and our Need for Science

There are two major aspects to Hobbes's picture of human nature. As we have seen, and will explore below, what motivates human beings to act is extremely important to Hobbes. The other aspect concerns human powers of judgment and reasoning, about which Hobbes tends to be extremely skeptical. Like many philosophers before him, Hobbes wants to present a more solid and certain account of human morality than is contained in everyday beliefs. Plato had contrasted knowledge with opinion. Hobbes contrasts science with a whole raft of less reliable forms of belief - from probable inference based on experience, right down to "absurdity, to which no living creature is subject but man" (Leviathan, v.7).

Hobbes has several reasons for thinking that human judgment is unreliable, and needs to be guided by science. Our judgments tend to be distorted by self-interest or by the pleasures and pains of the moment. We may share the same basic passions, but the various things of the world affect us all very differently; and we are inclined to use our feelings as measures for others. It becomes dogmatic through vanity and morality, as with "men vehemently in love with their own new opinions…and obstinately bent to maintain them, [who give] their opinions also that reverenced name of conscience" (Leviathan, vii.4). When we use words which lack any real objects of reference, or are unclear about the meaning of the words we use, the danger is not only that our thoughts will be meaningless, but also that we will fall into violent dispute. (Hobbes has scholastic philosophy in mind, but he also makes related points about the dangerous effects of faulty political ideas and ideologies.) We form beliefs about supernatural entities, fairies and spirits and so on, and fear follows where belief has gone, further distorting our judgment. Judgment can be swayed this way and that by rhetoric, that is, by the persuasive and "colored" speech of others, who can deliberately deceive us and may well have purposes that go against the common good or indeed our own good. Not least, much judgment is concerned with what we should do now, that is, with future events, "the future being but a fiction of the mind" (Leviathan, iii.7) and therefore not reliably known to us.

For Hobbes, it is only science, "the knowledge of consequences" (Leviathan, v.17), that offers reliable knowledge of the future and overcomes the frailties of human judgment. Unfortunately, his picture of science, based on crudely mechanistic premises and developed through deductive demonstrations, is not even plausible in the physical sciences. When it comes to the complexities of human behavior, Hobbes's model of science is even less satisfactory. He is certainly an acute and wise commentator of political affairs; we can praise him for his hard-headedness about the realities of human conduct, and for his determination to create solid chains of logical reasoning. Nonetheless, this does not mean that Hobbes was able to reach a level of "scientific" certainty in his judgments that had been lacking in all previous reflection on morals and politics.

c. Motivation

The most consequential aspect of Hobbes's account of human nature centers on his ideas about human motivation, and this topic is therefore at the heart of many debates about how to understand Hobbes's philosophy. Many interpreters have presented the Hobbesian agent as a self-interested, rationally calculating actor (those ideas have been important in modern political philosophy and economic thought, especially in terms of rational choice theories). It is true that some of the problems that face people like this - rational egoists, as philosophers call them - are similar to the problems Hobbes wants to solve in his political philosophy. And it is also very common for first-time readers of Hobbes to get the impression that he believes we're all basically selfish.

There are good reasons why earlier interpreters and new readers tend to think the Hobbesian agent is ultimately self-interested. Hobbes likes to make bold and even shocking claims to get his point across. "I obtained two absolutely certain postulates of human nature," he says, "one, the postulate of human greed by which each man insists upon his own private use of common property; the other, the postulate of natural reason, by which each man strives to avoid violent death" (De Cive, Epistle Dedicatory). What could be clearer? - We want all we can get, and we certainly want to avoid death. There are two problems with thinking that this is Hobbes's considered view, however. First, quite simply, it represents a false view of human nature. People do all sorts of altruistic things that go against their interests. They also do all sorts of needlessly cruel things that go against self-interest (think of the self-defeating lengths that revenge can run to). So it would be uncharitable to interpret Hobbes this way, if we can find a more plausible account in his work. Second, in any case Hobbes often relies on a more sophisticated view of human nature. He describes or even relies on motives that go beyond or against self-interest, such as pity, a sense of honor or courage, and so on. And he frequently emphasizes that we find it difficult to judge or appreciate just what our interests are anyhow. (Some also suggest that Hobbes's views on the matter shifted away from egoism after De Cive, but the point is not crucial here.)

The upshot is that Hobbes does not think that we are basically or reliably selfish; and he does not think we are fundamentally or reliably rational in our ideas about what is in our interests. He is rarely surprised to find human beings doing things that go against self-interest: we will cut off our noses to spite our faces, we will torture others for their eternal salvation, we will charge to our deaths for love of country. In fact, a lot of the problems that befall human beings, according to Hobbes, result from their being too littleconcerned with self-interest. Too often, he thinks, we are too much concerned with what others think of us, or inflamed by religious doctrine, or carried away by others' inflammatory words. This weakness as regards our self-interest has even led some to think that Hobbes is advocating a theory known as ethical egoism. This is to claim that Hobbes bases morality upon self-interest, claiming that we ought to do what it is most in our interest to do. But we shall see that this would over-simplify the conclusions that Hobbes draws from his account of human nature.

d. Political Philosophy

This is Hobbes's picture of human nature. We are needy and vulnerable. We are easily led astray in our attempts to know the world around us. Our capacity to reason is as fragile as our capacity to know; it relies upon language and is prone to error and undue influence. When we act, we may do so selfishly or impulsively or in ignorance, on the basis of faulty reasoning or bad theology or others' emotive speech.

What is the political fate of this rather pathetic sounding creature - that is, of us? Unsurprisingly, Hobbes thinks little happiness can be expected of our lives together. The best we can hope for is peaceful life under an authoritarian-sounding sovereign. The worst, on Hobbes's account, is what he calls the "natural condition of mankind," a state of violence, insecurity and constant threat. In outline, Hobbes's argument is that the alternative to government is a situation no one could reasonably wish for, and that any attempt to make government accountable to the people must undermine it, so threatening the situation of non-government that we must all wish to avoid. Our only reasonable option, therefore, is a "sovereign" authority that is totally unaccountable to its subjects. Let us deal with the "natural condition" of non-government, also called the "state of nature," first of all.

5. The Natural Condition of Mankind

The state of nature is "natural" in one specific sense only. For Hobbes political authority is artificial: in the "natural" condition human beings lack government, which is an authority created by men. What is Hobbes's reasoning here? He claims that the only authority that naturally exists among human beings is that of a mother over her child, because the child is so very much weaker than the mother (and indebted to her for its survival). Among adult human beings this is invariably not the case. Hobbes concedes an obvious objection, admitting that some of us are much stronger than others. And although he's very sarcastic about the idea that some are wiser than others, he doesn't have much difficulty with the idea that some are fools and others are dangerously cunning. Nonetheless, it's almost invariably true that every human being is capable of killing any other. Even the strongest must sleep; even the weakest might persuade others to help him kill another. (Leviathan, xiii.1-2) Because adults are "equal" in this capacity to threaten one another’s lives, Hobbes claims there is no natural source of authority to order their lives together. (He is strongly opposing arguments that established monarchs have a natural or God-given right to rule over us.)

Thus, as long as human beings have not successfully arranged some form of government, they live in Hobbes's state of nature. Such a condition might occur at the "beginning of time" (see Hobbes’s comments on Cain and Abel, Leviathan, xiii.11, Latin version only), or in "primitive" societies (Hobbes thought the American Indians lived in such a condition). But the real point for Hobbes is that a state of nature could just as well occur in seventeenth century England, should the King's authority be successfully undermined. It could occur tomorrow in every modern society, for example, if the police and army suddenly refused to do their jobs on behalf of government. Unless some effective authority stepped into the King's place (or the place of army and police and government), Hobbes argues the result is doomed to be deeply awful, nothing less than a state of war.

Why should peaceful cooperation be impossible without an overarching authority? Hobbes provides a series of powerful arguments that suggest it is extremely unlikely that human beings will live in security and peaceful cooperation without government. (Anarchism, the thesis that we should live without government, of course disputes these arguments.) His most basic argument is threefold. (Leviathan, xiii.3-9) (i) He thinks we will compete, violently compete, to secure the basic necessities of life and perhaps to make other material gains. (ii) He argues that we will challenge others and fight out of fear ("diffidence"), so as to ensure our personal safety. (iii) And he believes that we will seek reputation ("glory"), both for its own sake and for its protective effects (for example, so that others will be afraid to challenge us).

This is a more difficult argument than it might seem. Hobbes does not suppose that we are all selfish, that we are all cowards, or that we are all desperately concerned with how others see us. Two points, though. First, he does think that some of us are selfish, some of us cowardly, and some of us "vainglorious" (perhaps some people are of all of these!). Moreover, many of these people will be prepared to use violence to attain their ends - especially if there's no government or police to stop them. In this Hobbes is surely correct. Second, in some situations it makes good sense, at least in the short term, to use violence and to behave selfishly, fearfully or vaingloriously. If our lives seem to be at stake, after all, we're unlikely to have many scruples about stealing a loaf of bread; if we perceive someone as a deadly threat, we may well want to attack first, while his guard is down; if we think that there are lots of potential attackers out there, it's going to make perfect sense to get a reputation as someone who shouldn't be messed with. In Hobbes’s words, "the wickedness of bad men also compels good men to have recourse, for their own protection, to the virtues of war, which are violence and fraud." (De Cive, Epistle Dedicatory) As well as being more complex than first appears, Hobbes's argument becomes very difficult to refute.

Underlying this most basic argument is an important consideration about insecurity. As we shall see Hobbes places great weight on contracts (thus some interpreters see Hobbes as heralding a market society dominated by contractual exchanges). In particular, he often speaks of "covenants," by which he means a contract where one party performs his part of the bargain later than the other. In the state of nature such agreements aren't going to work. Only the weakest will have good reason to perform the second part of a covenant, and then only if the stronger party is standing over them. Yet a huge amount of human cooperation relies on trust, that others will return their part of the bargain over time. A similar point can be made about property, most of which we can't carry about with us and watch over. This means we must rely on others respecting our possessions over extended periods of time. If we can't do this, then many of the achievements of human society that involve putting hard work into land (farming, building) or material objects (the crafts, or modern industrial production, still unknown in Hobbes's time) will be near impossible.

One can reasonably object to such points: Surely there are basic duties to reciprocate fairly and to behave in a trustworthy manner? Even if there's no government providing a framework of law, judgment and punishment, don't most people have a reasonable sense of what is right and wrong, which will prevent the sort of contract-breaking and generalized insecurity that Hobbes is concerned with? Indeed, shouldn't our basic sense of morality prevent much of the greed, pre-emptive attack and reputation-seeking that Hobbes stressed in the first place? This is the crunch point of Hobbes's argument, and it is here (if anywhere) that one can accuse Hobbes of "pessimism." He makes two claims. The first concerns our duties in the state of nature (that is, the so-called "right of nature"). The second follows from this, and is less often noticed: it concerns the danger posed by our different and variable judgments of what is right and wrong.

On Hobbes's view the right of nature is quite simple to define. Naturally speaking - that is, outside of civil society – we have a right to do whatever we think will ensure our self-preservation. The worst that can happen to us is violent death at the hands of others. If we have any rights at all, if (as we might put it) nature has given us any rights whatsoever, then the first is surely this: the right to prevent violent death befalling us. But Hobbes says more than this, and it is this point that makes his argument so powerful. We do not just have a right to ensure our self-preservation: we each have a right to judge what will ensure our self-preservation. And this is where Hobbes's picture of humankind becomes important. Hobbes has given us good reasons to think that human beings rarely judge wisely. Yet in the state of nature no one is in a position to successfully define what is good judgment. If I judge that killing you is a sensible or even necessary move to safeguard my life, then - in Hobbes's state of nature – I have a right to kill you. Others might judge the matter differently, of course. Almost certainly you'll have quite a different view of things (perhaps you were just stretching your arms, not raising a musket to shoot me). Because we're all insecure, because trust is more-or-less absent, there's little chance of our sorting out misunderstandings peacefully, nor can we rely on some (trusted) third party to decide whose judgment is right. We all have to be judges in our own causes, and the stakes are very high indeed: life or death.

For this reason Hobbes makes very bold claims that sound totally amoral. "To this war of every man against every man," he says, "this also is consequent [i.e., it follows]: that nothing can be unjust. The notions of right and wrong, justice and injustice have no place [in the state of nature]." (Leviathan, xiii.13) He further argues that in the state of nature we each have a right to all things, "even to one another's body’ (Leviathan, xiv.4). Hobbes is dramatizing his point, but the core is defensible. If I judge that I need such and such - an object, another person's labor, another person’s death - to ensure my continued existence, then in the state of nature, there is no agreed authority to decide whether I'm right or wrong. New readers of Hobbes often suppose that the state of nature would be a much nicer place, if only he were to picture human beings with some basic moral ideas. But this is naïve: unless people share the same moral ideas, not just at the level of general principles but also at the level of individual judgment, then the challenge he poses remains unsolved: human beings who lack some shared authority are almost certain to fall into dangerous and deadly conflict.

There are different ways of interpreting Hobbes's view of the absence of moral constraints in the state of nature. Some think that Hobbes is imagining human beings who have no idea of social interaction and therefore no ideas about right and wrong. In this case, the natural condition would be a purely theoretical construction, and would demonstrate what both government and society do for human beings. (A famous statement about the state of nature in De Cive (viii.1) might support this interpretation: "looking at men as if they had just emerged from the earth like mushrooms and grown up without any obligation to each other…") Another, complementary view reads Hobbes as a psychological egoist, so that - in the state of nature as elsewhere – he is merely describing the interaction of ultimately selfish and amoral human beings.

Others suppose that Hobbes has a much more complex picture of human motivation, so that there is no reason to think moral ideas are absent in the state of nature. In particular, it's historically reasonable to think that Hobbes invariably has civil war in mind, when he describes our "natural condition." If we think of civil war, we need to imagine people who’ve lived together and indeed still do live together - huddled together in fear in their houses, banded together as armies or guerrillas or groups of looters. The problem here isn't a lack of moral ideas - far from it – rather that moral ideas and judgments differ enormously. This means (for example) that two people who are fighting tooth and nail over a cow or a gun can both think they're perfectly entitled to the object and both think they're perfectly right to kill the other - a point Hobbes makes explicitly and often. It also enables us to see that many Hobbesian conflicts are about religious ideas or political ideals (as well as self-preservation and so on) - as in the British Civil War raging while Hobbes wrote Leviathan, and in the many violent sectarian conflicts throughout the world today.

In the end, though, whatever account of the state of nature and its (a) morality we attribute to Hobbes, we must remember that it is meant to function as a powerful and decisive threat: if we do not heed Hobbes's teachings and fail to respect existing political authority, then the natural condition and its horrors of war await us.

a. The Laws of Nature and the Social Contract

Hobbes thinks the state of nature is something we ought to avoid, at any cost except our own self-preservation (this being our "right of nature," as we saw above). But what sort of "ought" is this? There are two basic ways of interpreting Hobbes here. It might be a counsel of prudence: avoid the state of nature, if you're concerned to avoid violent death. In this case Hobbes's advice only applies to us (i) if we agree that violent death is what we should fear most and should therefore avoid; and (ii) if we agree with Hobbes that only an unaccountable sovereign stands between human beings and the state of nature. This line of thought fits well with an egoistic reading of Hobbes, but we'll see that it faces serious problems.

The other way of interpreting Hobbes is not without problems either. This takes Hobbes to be saying that we ought, morally speaking, to avoid the state of nature. We have a duty to do what we can to avoid this situation arising, and a duty to end it, if at all possible. Hobbes often makes his view clear, that we have such moral obligations. But then two difficult questions arise: Why these obligations? And why are they obligatory?

Hobbes frames the issues in terms of an older vocabulary, using the idea of natural law that many ancient and medieval philosophers had relied on. Like them, he thinks that human reason can discern some eternal principles to govern our conduct. These principles are independent of (though also complementary to) whatever moral instruction we might get from God or religion. In other words, they are laws given by nature rather than revealed by God. But Hobbes makes radical changes to the content of these so-called laws of nature. In particular, he doesn't think that natural law provides any scope whatsoever to criticize or disobey the actual laws made by a government. He thus disagrees with those Protestants who thought that religious conscience might sanction disobedience of "immoral" laws, and with Catholics who thought that the commandments of the Pope have primacy over those of national political authorities.

Although he sets out nineteen laws of nature, it is the first two that are politically crucial. A third, that stresses the important of keeping to contracts we have entered into, is important in Hobbes's moral justifications of obedience to the sovereign. (The remaining sixteen can be quite simply encapsulated in the formula, "do as you would be done by." While the details are important for scholars of Hobbes, they do not affect the overall theory and will be ignored here.)

The first law reads as follows:

Every man ought to endeavor peace, as far as he has hope of obtaining it, and when he cannot obtain it, that he may seek and use all helps and advantages of war. (Leviathan, xiv.4)

This repeats the points we have already seen about our "right of nature," so long as peace does not appear to be a realistic prospect. The second law of nature is more complicated:

That a man be willing, when others are so too, as far-forth as for peace and defense of himself he shall think it necessary, to lay down this right to all things, and be contented with so much liberty against other men, as he would allow other men against himself. (Leviathan, xiv.5)

What Hobbes tries to tackle here is the transition from the state of nature to civil society. But how he does this is misleading and has generated much confusion and disagreement. The way that Hobbes describes this second law of nature makes it look as if we should all put down our weapons, give up (much of) our "right of nature," and jointly authorize a sovereign who will tell us what is permitted and punish us if we don't obey. But the problem is obvious. If the state of nature is anything like as bad as Hobbes has argued, then there's just no way people could ever make an agreement like this or put it into practice.

At the end of Leviathan, Hobbes seems to concede this point, saying "there is scarce a commonwealth in the world whose beginnings can in conscience be justified" ("Review and Conclusion," 8). That is: governments have invariably been foisted upon people by force and fraud, not by collective agreement. But Hobbes means to defend every existing government that is powerful enough to secure peace among its subjects - not just a mythical government that's been created by a peaceful contract out of a state of nature. His basic claim is that we should behave as if we had voluntarily entered into such a contract with everyone else in our society - everyone else, that is, except the sovereign authority.

In Hobbes's myth of the social contract, everyone except the person or group who will wield sovereign power lays down their "right to all things." They agree to limit drastically their right of nature, retaining only a right to defend their lives in case of immediate threat. (How limited this right of nature becomes in civil society has caused much dispute, because deciding what is an immediate threat is a question of judgment. It certainly permits us to fight back if the sovereign tries to kill us. But what if the sovereign conscripts us as soldiers? What if the sovereign looks weak and we doubt whether he can continue to secure peace…?) The sovereign, however, retains his (or her, or their) right of nature, which we have seen is effectively a right to all things - to decide what everyone else should do, to decide the rules of property, to judge disputes and so on. Hobbes concedes that there are moral limits on what sovereigns should do (God might call a sovereign to account). However, since in any case of dispute the sovereign is the only rightful judge - on this earth, that is – those moral limits make no practical difference. In every moral and political matter, the decisive question for Hobbes is always: who is to judge? As we have seen, in the state of nature, each of us is judge in our own cause, part of the reason why Hobbes thinks it is inevitably a state of war. Once civil society exists, the only rightful judge is the sovereign.

b. Why Should we Obey the Sovereign?

If we had all made a voluntary contract, a mutual promise, then it might seem half-way plausible to think we have an obligation to obey the sovereign (although even this requires the claim that promising is a moral value that overrides all others). If we have been conquered or, more fortunately, have simply been born into a society with an established political authority, this seems quite improbable. Hobbes has to make three steps here, all of which have seemed weak to many of his readers. First of all, he insists that promises made under threat of violence are nonetheless freely made, and just as binding as any others. Second, he has to put great weight on the moral value of promise keeping, which hardly fits with the absence of duties in the state of nature. Third, he has to give a story of how those of us born and raised in a political society have made some sort of implied promise to each other to obey, or at least, he has to show that we are bound (either morally or out of self-interest) to behave as if we had made such a promise.

In the first place, Hobbes draws on his mechanistic picture of the world, to suggest that threats of force do not deprive us of liberty. Liberty, he says, is freedom of motion, and I am free to move whichever way I wish, unless I am literally enchained. If I yield to threats of violence, that is my choice, for physically I could have done otherwise. If I obey the sovereign for fear of punishment or in fear of the state of nature, then that is equally my choice. Such obedience then comes, for Hobbes, to constitute a promise that I will continue to obey.

Second, promises carry a huge moral weight for Hobbes, as they do in all social contract theories. The question, however, is why we should think they are so important. Why should my (coerced) promise oblige me, given the wrong you committed in threatening me and demanding my valuables? Hobbes has no good answer to this question (but see below, on egoistic interpretations of Hobbes's thinking here). His theory suggests that (in the state of nature) you could do me no wrong, as the right of nature dictates that we all have a right to all things. Likewise, promises do not oblige in the state of nature, inasmuch as they go against our right of nature. In civil society, the sovereign's laws dictate what is right and wrong; if your threat was wrongful, then my promise will not bind me. But as the sovereign is outside of the original contract, he sets the terms for everyone else: so his threats create obligations.

As this suggests, Hobbesian promises are strangely fragile. Implausibly binding so long as a sovereign exists to adjudicate and enforce them, they lose all power should things revert to a state of nature. Relatedly, they seem to contain not one jot of loyalty. To be logically consistent, Hobbes needs to be politically implausible. Now there are passages where Hobbes sacrifices consistency for plausibility, arguing we have a duty to fight for our (former) sovereign even in the midst of civil war. Nonetheless the logic of his theory suggests that, as soon as government starts to weaken and disorder sets in, our duty of obedience lapses. That is, when the sovereign power needs our support, because it is no longer able to coerce us, there is no effective judge or enforcer of covenants, so that such promises no longer override our right of nature. This turns common sense on its head. Surely a powerful government can afford to be challenged, for instance by civil disobedience or conscientious objection? But when civil conflict and the state of nature threaten, in other words when government is failing, then we might reasonably think that political unity is as morally important as Hobbes always suggests. A similar question of loyalty also comes up when the sovereign power has been usurped - when Cromwell has supplanted the King, when a foreign invader has ousted our government. Right from the start, Hobbes's critics saw that his theory makes turncoats into moral heroes: our allegiance belongs to whoever happens to be holding the gun(s). Perversely, the only crime the makers of a coup can commit is to fail.

Why does this problem come about? To overcome the fact that his contract is a fiction, Hobbes is driven to construct a "sort of" promise out of the fact of our subjugation to whatever political authority exists. He stays wedded to the idea that obedience can only find a moral basis in a "voluntary" promise, because only this seems to justify the almost unlimited obedience and renunciation of individual judgment he's determined to prove. It is no surprise that Hobbes's arguments creak at every point: nothing could bear the weight of justifying such an overriding duty.

All the difficulties in finding a reliable moral obligation to obey might tempt us back to the idea that Hobbes is some sort of egoist. However, the difficulties with this tack are even greater. There are two sorts of egoism commentators have attributed to Hobbes: psychological and ethical. The first theory says that human beings always act egoistically, the second that they ought to act egoistically. Either view might support this simple idea: we should obey the sovereign, because his political authority is what keeps us from the evils of the natural condition. But the basic problem with such egoistic interpretations, from the point of view of Hobbes's system of politics, is shown when we think about cases where selfishness seems to conflict with the commands of the sovereign - for example, where illegal conduct will benefit us or keep us from danger. For a psychologically egoist agent, such behavior will be irresistible; for an ethically egoist agent, it will be morally obligatory. Now, providing the sovereign is sufficiently powerful and well-informed, he can prevent many such cases arising by threatening and enforcing punishments of those who disobey. Effective threats of punishment mean that obedience is in our self-interest. But such threats will not be effective when we think our disobedience can go undetected. After Orwell's 1984 we can imagine a state that is so powerful that no reasonable person would ever think disobedience could pay. But for Hobbes, such a powerful sovereign was not even conceivable: he would have had to assume that there would be many situations where people could reasonably hope to "get away with it." (Likewise, under non-totalitarian, liberal politics, there are many situations where illegal behavior is very unlikely to be detected or punished.) So, still thinking of egoistic agents, the more people do get away with it, the more reason others have to think they can do the same. Thus the problem of disobedience threatens to "snowball," undermining the sovereign and plunging selfish agents back into the chaos of the state of nature.

In other words, sovereignty as Hobbes imagined it, and liberal political authority as we know it, can only function where people feel some additional motivation apart from pure self-interest. Moreover, there is strong evidence that Hobbes was well aware of this. Part of Hobbes's interest in religion (a topic that occupies half of Leviathan) lies in its power to shape human conduct. Sometimes this does seem to work through self-interest, as in crude threats of damnation and hell-fire. But Hobbes's main interest lies in the educative power of religion, and indeed of political authority. Religious practices, the doctrines taught in the universities (!), the beliefs and habits inculcated by the institutions of government and society: how these can encourage and secure respect for law and authority seem to be even more important to Hobbes's political solutions than his theoretical social contract or shaky appeals to simple self-interest.

What are we to conclude, then, given the difficulties in finding a reliable moral or selfish justification for obedience? In the end, for Hobbes, everything rides on the value of peace. Hobbes wants to say both that civil order is in our "enlightened" self-interest, and that it is of overwhelming moral value. Life is never going to be perfect for us, and life under the sovereign is the best we can do. Recognizing this aspect ofeveryone's self-interest should lead us to recognize the moral value of supporting whatever authority we happen to live under. For Hobbes, this moral value is so great - and the alternatives so stark – that it should override every threat to our self-interest except the imminent danger of death. The million-dollar question is then: is a life of obedience to the sovereign really the best human beings can hope for?

c. Life Under the Sovereign

Hobbes has definite ideas about the proper nature, scope and exercise of sovereignty. Much that he says is cogent, and much of it can reduce the worries we might have about living under this drastically authoritarian sounding regime. Many commentators have stressed, for example, the importance Hobbes places upon the rule of law. His claim that much of our freedom, in civil society, "depends on the silence of the laws" is often quoted (Leviathan, xxi.18). In addition, Hobbes makes many points that are obviously aimed at contemporary debates about the rights of King and Parliament - especially about the sovereign's rights as regards taxation and the seizure of property, and about the proper relation between religion and politics. Some of these points continue to be relevant, others are obviously anachronistic: evidently Hobbes could not have imagined the modern state, with its vast bureaucracies, massive welfare provision and complicated interfaces with society. Nor could he have foreseen how incredibly powerful the state might become, meaning that "sovereigns" such as Hitler or Stalin might starve, brutalize and kill their subjects, to such an extent that the state of nature looks clearly preferable.

However, the problem with all of Hobbes's notions about sovereignty is that - on his account – it is not Hobbes the philosopher, nor we the citizens, who decide what counts as the proper nature, scope or exercise of sovereignty. He faces a systematic problem: justifying any limits or constraints on the sovereign involves making judgments about moral or practical requirements. But one of his greatest insights, still little recognized by many moral philosophers, is that any right or entitlement is only practically meaningful when combined with a concrete judgment as to what it dictates in some given case. Hobbes's own failure, however understandable, to foresee the growth of government and its powers only supports this thought: that the proper nature, scope or exercise of sovereignty is a matter of complex judgment. Alone among the people who comprise Hobbes's commonwealth, it is the sovereign who judges what form he should appear in, how far he should reach into the lives of his subjects, and how he should exercise his powers.

It should be added that the one part of his system that Hobbes concedes not to be proven with certainty is just this question: who or what should constitute the sovereign power. It was natural for Hobbes to think of a King, or indeed a Queen (he was born under Elizabeth I). But he was certainly very familiar with ancient forms of government, including aristocracy (government by an elite) and democracy (government by the citizens, who formed a relatively small group within the total population). Hobbes was also aware that an assembly such as Parliament could constitute a sovereign body. All have advantages and disadvantages, he argues. But the unity that comes about from having a single person at the apex, together with fixed rules of succession that pre-empt dispute about who this person should be, makes monarchy Hobbes's preferred option.

In fact, if we want to crack open Hobbes's sovereign, to be able to lay down concrete ideas about its nature and limits, we must begin with the question of judgment. For Hobbes, dividing capacities to judge between different bodies is tantamount to letting the state of nature straight back in. "For what is it to divide the power of a commonwealth, but to dissolve it; for powers divided mutually destroy each other." (Leviathan, xxix.12; cf De Cive, xii.5) Beyond the example of England in the 1640s, Hobbes hardly bothers to argue the point, although it is crucial to his entire theory. Always in his mind is the Civil War that arose when Parliament claimed the right to judge rules of taxation, and thereby prevented the King from ruling and making war as he saw fit, and when churches and religious sects claimed prerogatives that went against the King's decisions.

Especially given modern experiences of the division of powers, however, it's easy to see that these examples are extreme and atypical. We might recall the American constitution, where powers of legislation, execution and case-by-case judgment are separated (to Congress, President and the judiciary respectively) and counter-balance one another. Each of these bodies is responsible for judging different questions. There are often, of course, boundary disputes, as to whether legislative, executive or judicial powers should apply to a given issue, and no one body is empowered to settle this crucial question of judgment. Equally obviously, however, such disputes have not led to a state of nature (well, at least if we think of the US after the Civil War). For Hobbes it is simply axiomatic that disputation as to who should judge important social and political issues spells the end of the commonwealth. For us, it is equally obvious that only a few extreme forms of dispute have this very dangerous power. Dividing the powers that are important to government need not leave a society more open to those dangerous conflicts. Indeed, many would now argue that political compromises which provide different groups and bodies with independent space to judge certain social or political issues can be crucial for preventing disputes from escalating into violent conflict or civil war.

6. Conclusion

What happens, then, if we do not follow Hobbes in his arguments that judgment must, by necessity or by social contract or both, be the sole province of the sovereign? If we are optimists about the power of human judgment, and about the extent of moral consensus among human beings, we have a straightforward route to the concerns of modern liberalism. Our attention will not be on the question of social and political order, rather on how to maximize liberty, how to define social justice, how to draw the limits of government power, and how to realize democratic ideals. We will probably interpret Hobbes as a psychological egoist, and think that the problems of political order that obsessed him were the product of an unrealistic view of human nature, or unfortunate historical circumstances, or both. In this case, I suggest, we might as well not have read Hobbes at all.

If we are less optimistic about human judgment in morals and politics, however, we should not doubt that Hobbes's problems remain our problems. But hindsight shows grave limitations to his solutions. Theoretically, Hobbes fails to prove that we have an almost unlimited obligation to obey the sovereign. His arguments that sovereignty - the power to judge moral and political matters, and enforce those judgments - cannot be divided are not only weak; they are simply refuted by the (relatively) successful distribution of powers in modern liberal societies. Not least, the horrific crimes of twentieth century dictatorships show beyond doubt that judgment about right and wrong cannot be a question only for our political leaders.

If Hobbes's problems are real and his solutions only partly convincing, where will we go? It might reasonably be thought that this is the central question of modern political thought. We will have no doubt that peaceful coexistence is one of the greatest goods of human life, something worth many inconveniences, sacrifices and compromises. We will see that there is moral force behind the laws and requirements of the state, simply because human beings do indeed need authority and systems of enforcement if they are to cooperate peacefully. But we can hardly accept that, because human judgment is weak and faulty, that there can be only one judge of these matters - precisely because that judge might turn out to be very faulty indeed. Our concern will be how we can effectively divide power between government and people, while still ensuring that important questions of moral and political judgment are peacefully adjudicated. We will be concerned with the standards and institutions that provide for compromise between many different and conflicting judgments. And all the time, we will remember Hobbes's reminder that human life is never without inconvenience and troubles, that we must live with a certain amount of bad, to prevent the worst: fear of violence, and violent death.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Edwards, Alistair (2002) "Hobbes" in Interpreting Modern Political Philosophy: From Machiavelli to Marx, eds. A Edwards and J Townshend (Palgrave Macmillan, Houndmills)
    • A very helpful overview of key interpretative debates about Hobbes in the twentieth century.
  • Hill, Christopher (1961/1980) The Century of Revolution, 1603-1714, second ed (Routledge, London)
    • The classic work on the history and repercussions of England's civil war.
  • Hobbes, Thomas (1998 [1642]) On the Citizen, ed & trans Richard Tuck and Michael Silverthorne (Cambridge University Press, Cambridge)
    • The best translation of Hobbes's most straightforward book,De Cive.
  • Hobbes, Thomas (1994 [1651/1668]) Leviathan, ed Edwin Curley (Hackett, Indianapolis)
    • The best edition of Hobbes's magnum opus, including extensive additional material and many important variations (ignored by all other editions) between the English text and later Latin edition.
  • Sorrell, Tom (1986) Hobbes (Routledge & Kegan Paul, London)
    • A concise and well-judged account of Hobbes's life and works.
  • Sorrell, Tom, ed (1996) The Cambridge Companion to Hobbes (Cambridge University Press, Cambridge)
    • An excellent set of essays on all aspects of Hobbes's intellectual endeavors.

Author Information

Garrath Williams
Lancaster University
United Kingdom

Human Rights

Human rights are certain moral guarantees. This article examines the philosophical basis and content of the doctrine of human rights. The analysis consists of five sections and a conclusion. Section one assesses the contemporary significance of human rights, and argues that the doctrine of human rights has become the dominant moral doctrine for evaluating the moral status of the contemporary geo-political order. Section two proceeds to chart the historical development of the concept of human rights, beginning with a discussion of the earliest philosophical origins of the philosophical bases of human rights and culminating in some of most recent developments in the codification of human rights. Section three considers the philosophical concept of a human right and analyses the formal and substantive distinctions philosophers have drawn between various forms and categories of rights. Section four addresses the question of how philosophers have sought to justify the claims of human rights and specifically charts the arguments presented by the two presently dominant approaches in this field: interest theory and will theory. Section five then proceeds to discuss some of the main criticisms currently levelled at the doctrine of human rights and highlights some of the main arguments of those who have challenged the universalist and objectivist bases of human rights. Finally, a brief conclusion is presented, summarising the main themes addressed.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction: the contemporary significance of human rights
  2. Historical origins and development of the theory and practice of human rights
  3. Philosophical analysis of the concept of human rights
    1. Moral vs. Legal Rights
    2. Claim Rights & Liberty Rights
    3. Substantive categories of human rights
    4. Scope of human rights duties
  4. Philosophical justifications of human rights
    1. Do human rights require philosophical justification?
    2. The interests theory approach
    3. The Will Theory Approach
  5. Philosophical criticisms of human rights
    1. Moral relativism
    2. Epistemological criticisms of human rights
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction: the contemporary significance of human rights

Human rights have been defined as

basic moral guarantees that people in all countries and cultures allegedly have simply because they are people. Calling these guarantees "rights" suggests that they attach to particular individuals who can invoke them, that they are of high priority, and that compliance with them is mandatory rather than discretionary. Human rights are frequently held to be universal in the sense that all people have and should enjoy them, and to be independent in the sense that they exist and are available as standards of justification and criticism whether or not they are recognized and implemented by the legal system or officials of a country. (Nickel, 1992:561-2)

The moral doctrine of human rights aims at identifying the fundamental prerequisites for each human being leading a minimally good life. Human rights aim to identify both the necessary negative and positive prerequisites for leading a minimally good life, such as rights against torture and rights to health care. This aspiration has been enshrined in various declarations and legal conventions issued during the past fifty years, initiated by the Universal Declaration of Human Rights (1948) and perpetuated by, most importantly, the European Convention on Human Rights (1954) and the International Covenant on Civil and Economic Rights (1966). Together these three documents form the centrepiece of a moral doctrine that many consider to be capable of providing the contemporary geo-political order with what amounts to an international bill of rights. However, the doctrine of human rights does not aim to be a fully comprehensive moral doctrine. An appeal to human rights does not provide us with a fully comprehensive account of morality per se. Human rights do not, for example, provide us with criteria for answering such questions as whether telling lies is inherently immoral, or what the extent of one's moral obligations to friends and lovers ought to be? What human rights do primarily aim to identify is the basis for determining the shape, content, and scope of fundamental, public moral norms. As James Nickel states, human rights aim to secure for individuals the necessary conditions for leading a minimally good life. Public authorities, both national and international, are identified as typically best placed to secure these conditions and so, the doctrine of human rights has become, for many, a first port of moral call for determining the basic moral guarantees all of us have a right to expect, both of one another but also, primarily, of those national and international institutions capable of directly affecting our most important interests. The doctrine of human rights aspires to provide the contemporary, allegedly post-ideological, geo-political order with a common framework for determining the basic economic, political, and social conditions required for all individuals to lead a minimally good life. While the practical efficacy of promoting and protecting human rights is significantly aided by individual nation-states' legally recognising the doctrine, the ultimate validity of human rights is characteristically thought of as not conditional upon such recognition. The moral justification of human rights is thought to precede considerations of strict national sovereignty. An underlying aspiration of the doctrine of human rights is to provide a set of legitimate criteria to which all nation-states should adhere. Appeals to national sovereignty should not provide a legitimate means for nation-states to permanently opt out of their fundamental human rights-based commitments. Thus, the doctrine of human rights is ideally placed to provide individuals with a powerful means for morally auditing the legitimacy of those contemporary national and international forms of political and economic authority which confront us and which claim jurisdiction over us. This is no small measure of the contemporary moral and political significance of the doctrine of human rights. For many of its most strident supporters, the doctrine of human rights aims to provide a fundamentally legitimate moral basis for regulating the contemporary geo-political order.

2. Historical origins and development of the theory and practice of human rights

The doctrine of human rights rests upon a particularly fundamental philosophical claim: that there exists a rationally identifiable moral order, an order whose legitimacy precedes contingent social and historical conditions and applies to all human beings everywhere and at all times. On this view, moral beliefs and concepts are capable of being objectively validated as fundamentally and universally true. The contemporary doctrine of human rights is one of a number of universalist moral perspectives. The origins and development of the theory of human rights is inextricably tied to the development of moral universalism. The history of the philosophical development of human rights is punctuated by a number of specific moral doctrines which, though not themselves full and adequate expressions of human rights, have nevertheless provided a number of philosophical prerequisites for the contemporary doctrine. These include a view of morality and justice as emanating from some pre-social domain, the identification of which provides the basis for distinguishing between 'true' and merely ‘conventional’ moral principles and beliefs. The essential prerequisites for a defence of human rights also include a conception of the individual as the bearer of certain 'natural' rights and a particular view of the inherent and equal moral worth of each rational individual. I shall discuss each in turn.

Human rights rest upon moral universalism and the belief in the existence of a truly universal moral community comprising all human beings. Moral universalism posits the existence of rationally identifiable trans-cultural and trans-historical moral truths. The origins of moral universalism within Europe are typically associated with the writings of Aristotle and the Stoics. Thus, in his Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle unambiguously expounds an argument in support of the existence of a natural moral order. This natural order ought to provide the basis for all truly rational systems of justice. An appeal to the natural order provides a set of comprehensive and potentially universal criteria for evaluating the legitimacy of actual 'man-made' legal systems. In distinguishing between ‘natural justice' and 'legal justice’, Aristotle writes, ‘the natural is that which has the same validity everywhere and does not depend upon acceptance.' (Nicomachean Ethics, 189) Thus, the criteria for determining a truly rational system of justice pre-exist social and historical conventions. 'Natural justice' pre-exists specific social and political configurations. The means for determining the form and content of natural justice is the exercise of reason free from the distorting effects of mere prejudice or desire. This basic idea was similarly expressed by the Roman Stoics, such as Cicero and Seneca, who argued that morality originated in the rational will of God and the existence of a cosmic city from which one could discern a natural, moral law whose authority transcended all local legal codes. The Stoics' argued that this ethically universal code imposed upon all of us a duty to obey the will of god. The Stoics thereby posited the existence of a universal moral community effected through our shared relationship with god. The belief in the existence of a universal moral community was maintained in Europe by Christianity over the ensuing centuries. While some have discerned intimations towards the notion of rights in the writings of Aristotle, the Stoics, and Christian theologians, a concept of rights approximating that of the contemporary idea of human rights most clearly emerges during the 17th. And 18th. Centuries in Europe and the so-called doctrine of natural law.

The basis of the doctrine of natural law is the belief in the existence of a natural moral code based upon the identification of certain fundamental and objectively verifiable human goods. Our enjoyment of these basic goods is to be secured by our possession of equally fundamental and objectively verifiable natural rights. Natural law was deemed to pre-exist actual social and political systems. Natural rights were thereby similarly presented as rights individuals possessed independently of society or polity. Natural rights were thereby presented as ultimately valid irrespective of whether they had achieved the recognition of any given political ruler or assembly. The quintessential exponent of this position was the 17th. Century philosopher John Locke and, in particular, the argument he outlined in his Two Treatises of Government (1688). At the centre of Locke's argument is the claim that individuals possess natural rights, independently of the political recognition granted them by the state. These natural rights are possessed independently of, and prior to, the formation of any political community. Locke argued that natural rights flowed from natural law. Natural law originated from God. Accurately discerning the will of God provided us with an ultimately authoritative moral code. At root, each of us owes a duty of self-preservation to God. In order to successfully discharge this duty of self-preservation each individual had to be free from threats to life and liberty, whilst also requiring what Locke presented as the basic, positive means for self-preservation: personal property. Our duty of self-preservation to god entailed the necessary existence of basic natural rights to life, liberty, and property. Locke proceeded to argue that the principal purpose of the investiture of political authority in a sovereign state was the provision and protection of individuals' basic natural rights. For Locke, the protection and promotion of individuals’ natural rights was the sole justification for the creation of government. The natural rights to life, liberty, and property set clear limits to the authority and jurisdiction of the State. States were presented as existing to serve the interests, the natural rights, of the people, and not of a Monarch or a ruling cadre. Locke went so far as to argue that individuals are morally justified in taking up arms against their government should it systematically and deliberately fail in its duty to secure individuals' possession of natural rights.

Analyses of the historical predecessors of the contemporary theory of human rights typically accord a high degree of importance to Locke's contribution. Certainly, Locke provided the precedent of establishing legitimate political authority upon a rights foundation. This is an undeniably essential component of human rights. However, the philosophically adequate completion of theoretical basis of human rights requires an account of moral reasoning, that is both consistent with the concept of rights, but which does not necessarily require an appeal to the authority of some super-human entity in justifying human beings' claims to certain, fundamental rights. The 18th. Century German philosopher, Immanuel Kant provides such an account.

Many of the central themes first expressed within Kant's moral philosophy remain highly prominent in contemporary philosophical justifications of human rights. Foremost amongst these are the ideals of equality and the moral autonomy of rational human beings. Kant bestows upon contemporary human rights' theory the ideal of a potentially universal community of rational individuals autonomously determining the moral principles for securing the conditions for equality and autonomy. Kant provides a means for justifying human rights as the basis for self-determination grounded within the authority of human reason. Kant's moral philosophy is based upon an appeal to the formal principles of ethics, rather than, for example, an appeal to a concept of substantive human goods. For Kant, the determination of any such goods can only proceed from a correct determination of the formal properties of human reason and thus do not provide the ultimate means for determining the correct ends, or object, of human reason. Kant's moral philosophy begins with an attempt to correctly identify those principles of reasoning that can be applied equally to all rational persons, irrespective of their own specific desires or partial interests. In this way, Kant attaches a condition of universality to the correct identification of moral principles. For him, the basis of moral reasoning must rest upon a condition that all rational individuals are bound to assent to. Doing the right thing is thus not determined by acting in pursuit of one's own interests or desires, but acting in accordance with a maxim which all rational individuals are bound to accept. Kant terms this the categorical imperative, which he formulates in the following terms, 'act only on that maxim through which you can at the same time will that it should become a universal law.' (1948:84). Kant argues that this basic condition of universality in determining the moral principles for governing human relations is a necessary expression of the moral autonomy and fundamental equality of all rational individuals. The categorical imperative is self-imposed by morally autonomous and formally equal rational persons. It provides the basis for determining the scope and form of those laws which morally autonomous and equally rational individuals will institute in order to secure these very same conditions. For Kant, the capacity for the exercise of reason is the distinguishing characteristic of humanity and the basis for justifying human dignity. As the distinguishing characteristic of humanity, formulating the principles of the exercise of reason must necessarily satisfy a test of universality; they must be capable of being universally recognized by all equally rational agents. Hence, Kant's formulation of the categorical imperative. Kant’s moral philosophy is notoriously abstract and resists easy comprehension. Though often overlooked in accounts of the historical development of human rights, his contribution to human rights has been profound. Kant provides a formulation of fundamental moral principles that, though exceedingly formal and abstract, are based upon the twin ideals of equality and moral autonomy. Human rights are rights we give to ourselves, so to speak, as autonomous and formally equal beings. For Kant, any such rights originate in the formal properties of human reason, and not the will of some super-human being.

The philosophical ideas defended by the likes of Locke and Kant have come to be associated with the general Enlightenment project initiated during the 17th. and 18th. Centuries, the effects of which were to extend across the globe and over ensuing centuries. Ideals such as natural rights, moral autonomy, human dignity and equality provided a normative bedrock for attempts at re-constituting political systems, for overthrowing formerly despotic regimes and seeking to replace them with forms of political authority capable of protecting and promoting these new emancipatory ideals. These ideals effected significant, even revolutionary, political upheavals throughout the 18th. Century, enshrined in such documents as the United States' Declaration of Independence and the French National Assembly’s Declaration of the Rights of Man and Citizen. Similarly, the concept of individual rights continued to resound throughout the 19th. Century exemplified by Mary Wollstencraft's Vindication of the Rights of Women and other political movements to extend political suffrage to sections of society who had been denied the possession of political and civil rights. The concept of rights had become a vehicle for effecting political change. Though one could argue that the conceptual prerequisites for the defence of human rights had long been in place, a full Declaration of the doctrine of human rights only finally occurred during the 20th. Century and only in response to the most atrocious violations of human rights, exemplified by the Holocaust. The Universal Declaration of Human Rights (UDHR) was adopted by the UN General Assembly on 10th. December 1948 and was explicitly motivated to prevent the future occurrence of any similar atrocities. The Declaration itself goes far beyond any mere attempt to reassert all individuals' possession of the right to life as a fundamental and inalienable human right. The UDHR consists of a Preamble and 30 articles which separately identify such things as the right not to be tortured (article 5), a right to asylum (article 14), a right to own property (article 17), and a right to an adequate standard of living (article 25) as being fundamental human rights. As I noted earlier, the UDHR has been further supplemented by such documents as the European Convention for the Protection of Human Rights and Fundamental Freedoms (1953) and the International Covenant on Economic, Social and Cultural Rights (1966). The specific aspirations contained within these three documents have themselves been reinforced by innumerable other Declarations and Conventions. Taken together these various Declarations, conventions and covenants comprise the contemporary human rights doctrine and embody both the belief in the existence of a universally valid moral order and a belief in all human beings' possession of fundamental and equal moral status, enshrined within the concept of human rights. It is important to note, however, that the contemporary doctrine of human rights, whilst deeply indebted to the concept of natural rights, is not a mere expression of that concept but actually goes beyond it in some highly significant respects. James Nickel ( 1987: 8-10) identifies three specific ways in which the contemporary concept of human rights differs from, and goes beyond that of natural rights. First, he argues that contemporary human rights are far more concerned to view the realization of equality as requiring positive action by the state, via the provision of welfare assistance, for example. Advocates of natural rights, he argues, were far more inclined to view equality in formalistic terms, as principally requiring the state to refrain from 'interfering' in individuals’ lives. Second, he argues that, whereas advocates of natural rights tended to conceive of human beings as mere individuals, veritable 'islands unto themselves', advocates of contemporary human rights are far more willing to recognize the importance of family and community in individuals' lives. Third, Nickel views contemporary human rights as being far more 'internationalist' in scope and orientation than was typically found within arguments in support of natural rights. That is to say, the protection and promotion of human rights are increasingly seen as requiring international action and concern. The distinction drawn by Nickel between contemporary human rights and natural rights allows one to discern the development of the concept of human rights. Indeed, many writers on human rights agree in the identification of three generations of human rights. First generation rights consist primarily of rights to security, property, and political participation. These are most typically associated with the French and US Declarations. Second generation rights are construed as socio-economic rights, rights to welfare, education, and leisure, for example. These rights largely originate within the UDHR. The final and third generation of rights are associated with such rights as a right to national self-determination, a clean environment, and the rights of indigenous minorities. This generation of rights really only takes hold during the last two decades of the 20th. Century but represents a significant development within the doctrine of human rights generally.

While the full significance of human rights may only be finally dawning on some people, the concept itself has a history spanning over two thousand years. The development of the concept of human rights is punctuated by the emergence and assimilation of various philosophical and moral ideals and appears to culminate, at least to our eyes, in the establishment of a highly complex set of legal and political documents and institutions, whose express purpose is the protection and promotion of the fundamental rights of all human beings everywhere. Few should underestimate the importance of this particular current of human history.

3. Philosophical analysis of the concept of human rights

Human rights are rights that attach to human beings and function as moral guarantees in support of our claims towards the enjoyment of a minimally good life. In conceptual terms, human rights are themselves derivative of the concept of a right. This section focuses upon the philosophical analysis of the concept of a 'right' in order to clearly demonstrate the various constituent parts of the concept from which human rights emerges. In order to gain a full understanding of both the philosophical foundations of the doctrine of human rights and the different ways in which separate human rights function, a detailed analysis is required.

a. Moral vs. Legal Rights

The distinction drawn between moral rights and legal rights as two separate categories of rights is of fundamental importance to understanding the basis and potential application of human rights. Legal rights refer to all those rights found within existing legal codes. A legal right is a right that enjoys the recognition and protection of the law. Questions as to its existence can be resolved by simply locating the relevant legal instrument or piece of legislation. A legal right cannot be said to exist prior to its passing into law and the limits of its validity are set by the jurisdiction of the body which passed the relevant legislation. An example of a legal right would be my daughter's legal right to receive an adequate education, as enshrined within the United Kingdom's Education Act (1944). Suffice it to say, that the exercise of this right is limited to the United Kingdom. My daughter has no legal right to receive an adequate education from a school board in Southern California. Legal positivists argue that the only rights that can be said to legitimately exist are legal rights, rights that originate within a legal system. On this view, moral rights are not rights in the strict sense, but are better thought of as moral claims, which may or may not eventually be assimilated within national or international law. For a legal positivist, such as the 19th. Century legal philosopher Jeremy Bentham, there can be no such thing as human rights existing prior to, or independently from legal codification. For a positivist determining the existence of rights is no more complicated than locating the relevant legal statute or precedent. In stark contrast, moral rights are rights that, it is claimed, exist prior to and independently from their legal counterparts. The existence and validity of a moral right is not deemed to be dependent upon the actions of jurists and legislators. Many people argued, for example, that the black majority in apartheid South Africa possessed a moral right to full political participation in that country's political system, even though there existed no such legal right. What is interesting is that many people framed their opposition to apartheid in rights terms. What many found so morally repugnant about apartheid South Africa was precisely its denial of numerous fundamental moral rights, including the rights not to be discriminated against on grounds of colour and rights to political participation, to the majority of that country's inhabitants. This particular line of opposition and protest could only be pursued because of a belief in the existence and validity of moral rights. A belief that fundamental rights which may or may not have received legal recognition elsewhere, remained utterly valid and morally compelling even, and perhaps especially, in those countries whose legal systems had not recognized these rights. A rights-based opposition to apartheid South Africa could not have been initiated and maintained by appeal to legal rights, for obvious reasons. No one could legitimately argue that the legal political rights of non-white South Africans were being violated under apartheid, since no such legal rights existed. The systematic denial of such rights did, however, constitute a gross violation of those peoples' fundamental moral rights.

From the above example it should be clear that human rights cannot be reduced to, or exclusively identified with legal rights. The legal positivist's account of justified law excludes the possibility of condemning such systems as apartheid from a rights perspective. It might, therefore, appear tempting to draw the conclusion that human rights are best identified as moral rights. After all, the existence of the UDHR and various International Covenants, to which South Africa was not a signatory in most cases, provided opponents of apartheid with a powerful moral argument. Apartheid was founded upon the denial of fundamental human rights. Human rights certainly share an essential quality of moral rights, namely, that their valid existence is not deemed to be conditional upon their being legally recognized. Human rights are meant to apply to all human beings everywhere, regardless of whether they have received legal recognition by all countries everywhere. Clearly, there remain numerous countries that wholly or partially exclude formal legal recognition to fundamental human rights. Supporters of human rights in these countries insist that the rights remain valid regardless, as fundamental moral rights. The universality of human rights positively entails such claims. The universality of human rights as moral rights clearly lends greater moral force to human rights. However, for their part, legal rights are not subject to disputes as to their existence and validity in quite the way moral rights are. It would be a mistake to exclusively identify human rights with moral rights. Human rights are better thought of as both moral rights and legal rights. Human rights originate as moral rights and their legitimacy is necessarily dependent upon the legitimacy of the concept of moral rights. A principal aim of advocates of human rights is for these rights to receive universal legal recognition. This was, after all, a fundamental goal of the opponents of apartheid. Human rights are best thought of, therefore, as being both moral and legal rights. The legitimacy claims of human rights are tied to their status as moral rights. The practical efficacy of human rights is, however, largely dependent upon their developing into legal rights. In those cases where specific human rights do not enjoy legal recognition, such as in the example of apartheid above, moral rights must be prioritised with the intention that defending the moral claims of such rights as a necessary prerequisite for the eventual legal recognition of the rights in question.

b. Claim Rights & Liberty Rights

To gain an understanding of the functional properties of human rights it is necessary to consider the more specific distinction drawn between claim rights and liberty rights. It should be noted that it is something of a convention to begin such discussions by reference to W.N. Hohfeld's (1919) more extended classification of rights. Hohfeld identified four categories of rights: liberty rights, claim rights, power rights, and immunity rights. However, numerous scholars have subsequently tended to collapse the last two within the first two and hence to restrict attention to liberty rights and claim rights. The political philosopher Peter Jones (1994) provides one such example.

Jones restricts his focus to the distinction between claim rights and liberty rights. He conforms to a well-established trend in rights' analysis in viewing the former as being of primary importance. Jones defines a claim right as consisting of being owed a duty. A claim right is a right one holds against another person or persons who owe a corresponding duty to the right holder. To return to the example of my daughter. Her right to receive an adequate education is a claim right held against the local education authority, which has a corresponding duty to provide her with the object of the right. Jones identifies further necessary distinctions within the concept of a claim right when he distinguishes between a positive claim right and a negative claim right. The former are rights one holds to some specific good or service, which some other has a duty to provide. My daughter's claim right to education is therefore a positive claim right. Negative claim rights, in contrast, are rights one holds against others' interfering in or trespassing upon one's life or property in some way. My daughter could be said to possess a negative claim right against others attempting to steal her mobile phone, for example. Indeed, such examples lead on to the final distinction Jones identifies within the concept of claim rights: rights held 'in personam' and rights held ‘in rem’. Rights held in personam are rights one holds against some specifically identified duty holder, such as the education authority. In contrast, rights held in rem are rights held against no one in particular, but apply to everyone. Thus, my daughter's right to an education would be practically useless were it not held against some identifiable, relevant, and competent body. Equally, her right against her mobile phone being stolen from her would be highly limited if it did not apply to all those capable of potentially performing such an act. Claim rights, then, can be of either a positive or a negative character and they can be held either in personam or in rem.

Jones defines liberty rights as rights which exist in the absence of any duties not to perform some desired activity and thus consist of those actions one is not prohibited from performing. In contrast to claim rights, liberty rights are primarily negative in character. For example, I may be said to possess a liberty right to spend my vacations lying on a particularly beautiful beach in Greece. Unfortunately, no one has a duty to positively provide for this particular exercise of my liberty right. There is no authority or body, equivalent to an education authority, for example, who has a responsibility to realize my dream for me. A liberty right can be said, then, to be a right to do as one pleases precisely because one is not under an obligation, grounded in others' claim rights, to refrain from so acting. Liberty rights provide for the capacity to be free, without actually providing the specific means by which one may pursue the objects of one's will. For example, a multi-millionaire and a penniless vagrant both possess an equal liberty right to holiday in the Caribbean each year.

c. Substantive categories of human rights

The above section was concerned to analyse what might be termed the 'formal properties' of rights. This section, in contrast, proceeds to consider the different categories of substantive human rights. If one delves into all of the various documents that together form the codified body of human rights, one can identify and distinguish between five different categories of substantive human rights. These are as follows: rights to life; rights to freedom; rights to political participation; rights to the protection of the rule of law; rights to fundamental social, economic, and cultural goods. These rights span the so-called three generations of rights and involve a complex combination of both liberty and claim rights. Some rights, such as for example the right to life, consist of both liberty and claim rights in roughly equal measure. Thus, the adequate protection of the right to life requires the existence of liberty rights against others trespassing against one's person and the existence of claim rights to have access to basic prerequisites to sustaining one's life, such as an adequate diet and health-care. Other rights, such as social, economic, and cultural rights, for example, are weighted more heavily towards the existence of various claim rights, which requires the positive provision of the objects of such rights. The making of substantive distinctions between human rights can have controversial, but important, consequences. Human rights are typically understood to be of equal value, each right is conceived of as equally important as every other. On this view, there can exist no potential for conflict between fundamental human rights. One is simply meant to attach equal moral weight to each and every human right. This prohibits arranging human rights in order of importance. However, conflict between rights can and does occur. Treating all human rights as of equal importance prohibits any attempts to address or resolve such conflict when it arises. Take the example of a hypothetical developing world country with severely limited financial and material resources. This country is incapable of providing the resources for realising all of the human rights for all of its citizens, though it is committed to doing so. In the meantime, government officials wish to know which human rights are more absolute than others, which fundamental human rights should it immediately prioritise and seek to provide for? This question, of course, cannot be answered if one sticks to the position that all rights are of equal importance. It can only be addressed if one allows for the possibility that some human rights are more fundamental than others and that the morally correct action for the government to take would be to prioritise these rights. A refusal to do so, no matter how consistent it may be philosophically would be tantamount to dogmatically sticking one's head in the metaphorical sands. Attempting to make such distinctions is, of course, a philosophically fraught exercise. It clearly requires the existence of some more ultimate criteria against which one can 'measure' the relative importance of separate human rights. This is a highly controversial issue within the philosophy of human rights and one which I shall return to when I consider how philosophers attempt to justify the doctrine of human rights. What remains to be addressed in our analysis of the concept of a human right are the questions of what adequately implementing human rights generally requires, and upon whom does this task fall; who has responsibility for protecting and promoting human rights and what is required of them to do so?

d. Scope of human rights duties

Human rights are said to be possessed equally, by everyone. A conventional corollary of this claim is that everyone has a duty to protect and promote the human rights of everyone else. However, in practice, the onus for securing human rights typically falls upon national governments and international, inter-governmental bodies. Philosophers such as Thomas Pogge (1995) argue that the moral burden for securing human rights should fall disproportionately upon such institutions precisely because they are best placed and most able to effectively perform the task. On this reading, non-governmental organizations and private citizens have an important role to play in supporting the global protection of human rights, but the onus must fall upon the relevant national and international institutions, such as the governments of nation-states and such bodies as the United Nations and the World Bank. One might wish to argue that, for example, human rights can be adequately secured by the existence of reciprocal duties held between individuals across the globe. However, 'privatizing' human rights in this fashion would ignore two particularly salient factors: individuals have a tendency to prioritise the moral demands of those closest to them, particularly members of their own family or immediate community; individuals' ability to exercise their duties is, to a large extent, determined by their own personal financial circumstances. Thus, global inequalities in the distribution of wealth fundamentally undermine the ability of those in the poorer countries to reciprocate assistance provided them by those living in wealthier countries. Reasons such as these underlie Pogge's insistence that the onus of responsibility lies at the level of national and international institutions. Adequately protecting and promoting human rights requires both nation-states ensuring the adequate provision of services and institutions for their own citizens and the co-operation of nation-states within international institutions acting to secure the requisite global conditions for the protection and promotion of everyone's human rights.

What must such bodies actively do to adequately secure individuals' human rights? Does my daughter’s human right to receive an adequate education require the education authority to do everything possible to assist and enhance my child's education? Does it require the provision of a world-class library, frequent study trips abroad, and employing the most able and best-qualified teachers? The answer is, of course, no. Given the relative scarcity of resources and the demands placed upon those resources, we are inclined to say that adequately securing individuals' human rights extends to the establishment of decent social and governmental practice so as to ensure that all individuals have the opportunity of leading a minimally good life. In the first instance, national governments are typically held to be primarily responsible for the adequate provision of their own citizens' human rights. Philosophers such as Brian Orend (2002) endorse this aspiration when he writes that the object of human rights is to secure 'minimal levels of decent and respectful treatment.' It is important to note, however, that the duty ensure the provision of even minimal levels of decent and respectful treatment cannot be strictly limited by national boundaries. The adequate protection and promotion of everyone's human rights does require, for example, the more affluent and powerful nation-states providing sufficient assistance to those countries currently incapable of adequately ensuring the protection of their own citizens' basic human rights. While some may consider Orend's aspirations for human rights to be unduly cautious, even the briefest survey of the extent of human suffering and deprivation in many parts of the world today is sufficient to demonstrate just how far we are from realizing even this fairly minimal standard.

National and international institutions bear the primary responsibility of securing human rights and the test for successfully fulfilling this responsibility is the creation of opportunities for all individuals to lead a minimally good life. The realization of human rights requires establishing the conditions for all human beings to lead minimally good lives and thus should not be confused as an attempt to create a morally perfect society. The impression that many have of human rights as being unduly utopian testifies less to the inherent demands of human rights and more to the extent to which even fairly modest aspirations are so far from being realized in the world today. The actual aspirations of human rights are, on the face of it, quite modest. However, this should not distract from a full appreciation of the possible force of human rights. Human rights call for the creation of politically democratic societies in which all citizens have the means of leading a minimally good life. While the object of individual human rights may be modest, the force of that right is intended to be near absolute. That is to say, the demands of rights are meant to take precedence over other possible social goals. Ronald Dworkin has coined the term 'rights as trumps' to describe this property. He writes that, 'rights are best understood as trumps over some background justification for political decisions that states a goal for the community as a whole.' (1977:153) In general, Dworkin argues, considerations of rights claims must take priority over alternative considerations when formulating public policy and distributing public benefits. Thus, for example, a minority's possession of rights against discriminatory treatment should trump any and all considerations of the possible benefits that the majority would derive from discriminating against the minority group. Similarly, an individual's right to an adequate diet should trump other individuals’ desires to eat lavish meals, despite the aggregate gain in pleasure these individuals would derive. For Dworkin, rights as trumps expresses the fundamental ideal of equality upon which the contemporary doctrine of human rights rests. Treating rights as trumps is a means for ensuring that all individuals are treated in an equal and like fashion in respect of the provision of fundamental human rights. Fully realizing the aspirations of human rights may not require the provision of 'state of the art' resources, but this should not detract from the force of human rights as taking priority over alternative social and political considerations.

4. Philosophical justifications of human rights

We have established that human rights originate as moral rights but that the successful passage of many human rights into international and national law enables one to think of human rights as, in many cases, both moral rights and legal rights. Furthermore, human rights may be either claim rights or liberty rights, and have a negative or a positive complexion in respect of the obligations imposed by others in securing the right. Human rights may be divided into five different categories and the principal object of securing human rights is the creation of the conditions for all individuals to have the opportunity to lead a minimally good life. Finally, human rights are widely considered to trump other social and political considerations in the allocation of public resources. Broadly speaking, philosophers generally agree on such issues as the formal properties of human rights, the object of human rights, and the force of human rights. However, there is much less agreement upon the fundamental question on how human rights may be philosophically justified. It would be fair to say that philosophers have provided many different, at times even conflicting, answers to this question. Philosophers have sought to justify human rights by appeal to single ideals such as equality, autonomy, human dignity, fundamental human interests, the capacity for rational agency, and even democracy. For the purposes of clarity and relative simplicity I will focus upon the two, presently most prominent, philosophical attempts to justify human rights: interests theory and will theory. Before I do that, it is necessary to address a prior question.

a. Do human rights require philosophical justification?

Many people tend to take the validity of human rights for granted. Certainly, for many non-philosophers human rights may all too obviously appear to rest upon self-evidently true and universally valid moral principles. In this respect, human rights may be perceived as empirical facts about the contemporary world. Human rights do exist and many people do act in accordance with the correlative duties and obligations respecting human rights entails. No supporter of human rights could possibly complain about such perceptions. If nothing else, the prevalence of such views is pragmatically valuable for the cause of human rights. However, moral philosophers do not enjoy such licence for epistemological complacency. Moral philosophers remain concerned by the question of the philosophical foundations of human rights. There is a good reason why we should all be concerned with such a question. What might be termed the 'philosophically naïve' view of human rights effectively construes human rights as legal rights. The validity of human rights is closely tied to, and dependent upon, the legal codification of human rights. However, as was argued earlier, such an approach is not sufficient to justify human rights. Arguments in support of the validity of any moral doctrine can never be settled by simply pointing to the empirical existence of particular moral beliefs or concepts. Morality is fundamentally concerned with what ought to be the case, and this cannot be settled by appeals to what is the case, or is perceived to be the case. From such a basis, it would have been very difficult to argue that apartheid South Africa, to take an earlier example, was a morally unjust regime. One must not confuse the law with morality, per se. Nor consider the two to be simply co-extensional. Human rights originate as moral rights. Human rights claim validity everywhere and for everyone, irrespective of whether they have received comprehensive legal recognition, and even irrespective of whether everyone is agreement with the claims and principles of human rights. Thus, one cannot settle the question of the philosophical validity of human rights by appealing to purely empirical observations upon the world. As a moral doctrine, human rights have to be demonstrated to be valid as norms and not facts. In order to achieve this, one has to turn to moral philosophy. Presently, two particular approaches to the question of the validity of human rights predominate: what might be loosely termed the 'interests theory approach' and the ‘will theory approach’.

b. The interests theory approach

Advocates of the interests theory approach argue that the principal function of human rights is to protect and promote certain essential human interests. Securing human beings' essential interests is the principal ground upon which human rights may be morally justified. The interests approach is thus primarily concerned to identify the social and biological prerequisites for human beings leading a minimally good life. The universality of human rights is grounded in what are considered to be some basic, indispensable, attributes for human well-being, which all of us are deemed necessarily to share. Take, for example, an interest each of us has in respect of our own personal security. This interest serves to ground our claim to the right. It may require the derivation of other rights as prerequisites to security, such as the satisfaction of basic nutritional needs and the need to be free from arbitrary detention or arrest, for example. The philosopher John Finnis provides a good representative of the interests theory approach. Finnis (1980) argues that human rights are justifiable on the grounds of their instrumental value for securing the necessary conditions of human well-being. He identifies seven fundamental interests, or what he terms 'basic forms of human good', as providing the basis for human rights. These are: life and its capacity for development; the acquisition of knowledge, as an end in itself; play, as the capacity for recreation; aesthetic expression; sociability and friendship; practical reasonableness, the capacity for intelligent and reasonable thought processes; and finally, religion, or the capacity for spiritual experience. According to Finnis, these are the essential prerequisites for human well-being and, as such, serve to justify our claims to the corresponding rights, whether they be of the claim right or liberty right variety.

Other philosophers who have defended human rights from an interests-based approach have addressed the question of how an appeal to interests can provide a justification for respecting and, when necessary, even positively acting to promote the interests of others. Such questions have a long heritage in western moral and political philosophy and extend at least as far back as the 17th. Century philosopher Thomas Hobbes. Typically, this approach attempts to provide what James Nickel (1987:84) has termed 'prudential reasons' in support of human rights. Taking as the starting point the claim that all human beings possess basic and fundamental interests, advocates of this approach argue that each individual owes a basic and general duty to respect the rights of every other individual. The basis for this duty is not mere benevolence or altruism, but individual self-interest. As Nickel writes, 'a prudential argument from fundamental interests attempts to show that it would be reasonable to accept and comply with human rights, in circumstances where most others are likely to do so, because these norms are part of the best means for protecting one's fundamental interests against actions and omissions that endanger them.' (ibid). Protecting one’s own fundamental interests requires others' willingness to recognize and respect these interests, which, in turn, requires reciprocal recognition and respect of the fundamental interests of others. The adequate protection of each individual's fundamental interests necessitates the establishment of a co-operative system, the fundamental aim of which is not to promote the common good, but the protection and promotion of individuals' self-interest.

For many philosophers the interests approach provides a philosophically powerful defence of the doctrine of human rights. It has the apparent advantage of appealing to human commonality, to those attributes we all share, and, in so doing, offers a relatively broad-based defence of the plethora of human rights considered by many to be fundamental and inalienable. The interests approach also provides for the possibility of resolving some of the potential disputes which can arise over the need to prioritise some human rights over others. One may do this, for example, by hierarchically ordering the corresponding interests identified as the specific object, or content, of each right.

However, the interests approach is subject to some significant criticisms. Foremost amongst these is the necessary appeal interests' theorists make to some account of human nature. The interests-approach is clearly operating with, at the very least, an implicit account of human nature. Appeals to human nature have, of course, proven to be highly controversial and typically resist achieving the degree of consensus required for establishing the legitimacy of any moral doctrine founded upon an account of human nature. For example, combining the appeal to fundamental interests with the aspiration of securing the conditions for each individual leading a minimally good life would be complicated by social and cultural diversity. Clearly, as the economic philosopher Amartya Sen (1999) has argued, the minimal conditions for a decent life are socially and culturally relative. Providing the conditions for leading a minimally good life for the residents of Greenwich Village would be significantly different to securing the same conditions for the residents of a shanty town in Southern Africa or South America. While the interests themselves may be ultimately identical, adequately protecting these interests will have to go beyond the mere specification of some purportedly general prerequisites for satisfying individuals' fundamental interests. Other criticisms of the interests approach have focused upon the appeal to self-interest as providing a coherent basis for fully respecting the rights of all human beings. This approach is based upon the assumption that individuals occupy a condition of relatively equal vulnerability to one another. However, this is simply not the case. The model cannot adequately defend the claim that a self-interested agent must respect the interests of, for example, much less powerful or geographically distant individuals, if she wishes to secure her own interests. On these terms, why should a purely self-interested and over-weight individual in, say, Los Angeles or London, care for the interests of a starving individual in some distant and impoverished continent? In this instance, the starving person is not in a position to affect their overweight counterpart's fundamental interests. The appeal to pure self-interest ultimately cannot provide a basis for securing the universal moral community at the heart of the doctrine of human rights. It cannot justify the claims of universal human rights. An even more philosophically oriented vein of criticism focuses upon the interests' based approach alleged neglect of constructive human agency as a fundamental component of morality generally. Put simply, the interests-based approach tends to construe our fundamental interests as pre-determinants of human moral agency. This can have the effect of subordinating the importance of the exercise of freedom as a principal moral ideal. One might seek to include freedom as a basic human interest, but freedom is not constitutive of our interests on this account. This particular concern lies at the heart of the so-called 'will approach' to human rights.

c. The Will Theory Approach

In contrast to the interests approach, the will theory attempts to establish the philosophical validity of human rights upon a single human attribute: the capacity for freedom. Will theorists argue that what is distinctive about human agency is the capacity for freedom and that this ought to constitute the core of any account of rights. Ultimately, then, will theorists view human rights as originating in, or reducible to, a single, constitutive right, or alternatively, a highly limited set of purportedly fundamental attributes. H.L.A. Hart, for example, inferentially argues that all rights are reducible to a single, fundamental right. He refers to this as 'equal right of all men to be free.' (1955:77). Hart insists that rights to such things as political participation or to an adequate diet, for example, are ultimately reducible to, and derivative of, individuals' equal right to liberty. Henry Shue (1996) develops upon Hart's inferential argument and argues that liberty alone is not ultimately sufficient for grounding all of the rights posited by Hart. Shue argues that many of these rights imply more than mere individual liberty and extend to include security from violence and the necessary material conditions for personal survival. Thus, he grounds rights upon liberty, security, and subsistence. The moral philosopher Alan Gewirth (1978, 1982) has further developed upon such themes. Gewirth argues that the justification of our claims to the possession of basic human rights is grounded in what he presents as the distinguishing characteristic of human beings generally: the capacity for rationally purposive agency. Gewirth states that the recognition of the validity of human rights is a logical corollary of recognizing oneself as a rationally purposive agent since the possession of rights are the necessary means for rationally purposive action. Gewirth grounds his argument in the claim that all human action is rationally purposive. Every human action is done for some reason, irrespective of whether it be a good or a bad reason. He argues that in rationally endorsing some end, say the desire to write a book, one must logically endorse the means to that end; as a bare minimum one's own literacy. He then asks what is required to be a rationally purposive agent in the first place? He answers that freedom and well-being are the two necessary conditions for rationally purposive action. Freedom and well-being are the necessary means to acting in a rationally purposive fashion. They are essential prerequisites for being human, where to be human is to possess the capacity for rationally purposive action. As essential prerequisites, each individual is entitled to have access to them. However, Gewirth argues that each individual cannot simply will their own enjoyment of these prerequisites for rational agency without due concern for others. He bases the necessary concern for others' human rights upon what he terms the 'principle of generic consistency' (PGC). Gewirth argues that each individual’s claim to the basic means for rationally purposive action is based upon an appeal to a general, rather than, specific attribute of all relevant agents. I cannot logically will my own claims to basic human rights without simultaneously accepting the equal claims of all rationally purposive agents to the same basic attributes. Gewirth has argued that there exists an absolute right to life possessed separately and equally by all of us. In so claiming, Gewirth echoes Dworkin's concept of rights as trumps, but ultimately goes further than Dworkin is prepared to do by arguing that the right to life is absolute and cannot, therefore, be overridden under any circumstances. He states that a 'right is absolute when it cannot be overridden in any circumstances, so that it can never be justifiably infringed and it must be fulfilled without any exceptions.' (1982:92). Will theorists then attempt to establish the validity of human rights upon the ideal of personal autonomy: rights are a manifestation of the exercise of personal autonomy. In so doing, the validity of human rights is necessarily tied to the validity of personal autonomy. On the face of it, this would appear to be a very powerful, philosophical position. After all, as someone like Gewirth might argue, critics of this position would themselves necessarily be acting autonomously and they cannot do this without simultaneously requiring the existence of the very means for such action: even in criticizing human rights one is logically pre-supposing the existence of such rights.

Despite the apparent logical force of the will approach, it has been subjected to various forms of criticism. A particularly important form of criticism focuses upon the implications of will theory for so-called 'marginal cases'; human beings who are temporarily or permanently incapable of acting in a rationally autonomous fashion. This would include individuals who have diagnosed from suffering from dementia, schizophrenia, clinical depression, and, also, individuals who remain in a comatose condition, from which they may never recover. If the constitutive condition for the possession of human rights is said to be the capacity for acting in a rationally purposive manner, for example, then it seems to logically follow, that individuals incapable of satisfying this criteria have no legitimate claim to human rights. Many would find this conclusion morally disturbing. However, a strict adherence to the will approach is entailed by it. Some human beings are temporarily or permanently lacking the criteria Gewirth, for instance, cites as the basis for our claims to human rights. It is difficult to see how they could be assimilated within the community of the bearers of human rights on the terms of Gewirth's argument. Despite this, the general tendency is towards extending human rights considerations towards many of the so-called 'marginal cases'. To do otherwise would appear to many to be intuitively wrong, if not ultimately defensible by appeal to practical reason. This may reveal the extent to which many peoples' support of human rights includes an ineluctable element of sympathy, taking the form of a general emotional concern for others. Thus, strictly applying the will theorists' criteria for membership of the community of human rights bearers would appear to result in the exclusion of some categories of human beings who are presently recognized as legitimate bearers of human rights.

The interests theory approach and the will theory approach contain strengths and weaknesses. When consistently and separately applied to the doctrine of human rights, each approach appears to yield conclusions that may limit or undermine the full force of those rights. It may be that philosophical supporters of human rights need to begin to consider the potential philosophical benefits attainable through combining various themes and elements found within these (and other) philosophical approaches to justifying human rights. Thus, further attempts at justifying the basis and content of human rights may benefit from pursuing a more thematically pluralist approach than has typically been the case to date.

5. Philosophical criticisms of human rights

The doctrine of human rights has been subjected to various forms of fundamental, philosophical criticism. These challenges to the philosophical validity of human rights as a moral doctrine differ from critical appraisals of the various philosophical theories supportive of the doctrine for the simple reason that they aim to demonstrate what they perceive to the philosophical fallacies upon which human rights are founded. Two such forms of critical analysis bear particular attention: one which challenges the universalist claims of human rights, and another which challenges the presumed objective character of human rights principles.

a. Moral relativism

Philosophical supporters of human rights are necessarily committed to a form of moral universalism. As moral principles and as a moral doctrine, human rights are considered to be universally valid. However, moral universalism has long been subject to criticism by so-called moral relativists. Moral relativists argue that universally valid moral truths do not exist. For moral relativists, there is simply no such thing as a universally valid moral doctrine. Relativists view morality as a social and historical phenomenon. Moral beliefs and principles are therefore thought of as socially and historically contingent, valid only for those cultures and societies in which they originate and within which they are widely approved. Relativists point to the vast array of diverse moral beliefs and practices apparent in the world today as empirical support for their position. Even within a single, contemporary society, such as the United States or Great Britain, one can find a wide diversity of fundamental moral beliefs, principles, and practices. Contemporary, complex societies are thus increasingly considered to be pluralist and multicultural in character. For many philosophers the multicultural character of such societies serves to fundamentally restrict the substance and scope of the regulative political principles governing those societies. In respect of human rights, relativists have tended to focus upon such issues as the presumed individualist character of the doctrine of human rights. It has been argued by numerous relativists that human rights are unduly biased towards morally individualist societies and cultures, at the necessary expense of the communal moral complexion of many Asian and African societies. At best, some human rights' articles may be considered to be redundant within such societies, at worse they may appear to be positively harmful if fully implemented, replacing the fundamental values of one civilization with those of another and thereby perpetuating a form of cultural and moral imperialism.

The philosophical debate between universalists and relativists is far too complex to adequately summarise here. However, certain immediate responses to the relativist critique of human rights are immediately available. First, merely pointing to moral diversity and the presumed integrity of individual cultures and societies does not, by itself, provide a philosophical justification for relativism, nor a sufficient critique of universalism. After all, there have existed and continue to exist many cultures and societies whose treatment of their own people leaves much to be desired. Is the relativist genuinely asking us to recognize and respect the integrity of Nazi Germany, or any other similarly repressive regime? There can be little doubt that, as it stands, relativism is incompatible with human rights. On the face of it, this would appear to lend argumentative weight to the universalist support of human rights. After all, one may speculate as to the willingness of any relativist to actually forego their possession of human rights if and when the social surroundings demanded it. Similarly, relativist arguments are typically presented by members of the political elites within those countries whose systematic oppression of their peoples has attracted the attention of advocates of human rights. The exponential growth of grass-roots human rights organizations across many countries in the world whose cultures are alleged to be incompatible with the implementation of human rights, raises serious questions as to the validity and integrity of such 'indigenous' relativists. At its worst, the doctrine of moral relativism may be being deployed in an attempt to illegitimately justify oppressive political systems. The concern over the presumed incompatibility between human rights and communal moral systems appears to be a more valid issue. Human rights have undeniably conceived of the principal bearer of human rights as the individual person. This is due, in large part, to the Western origins of human rights. However, it would be equally fair to say that the so-called 'third generation' of human rights is far more attuned to the communal and collective basis of many individuals' lives. In keeping with the work of political philosophers such as Will Kymlicka, there is increasing awareness of the need to tailor human rights principles to such things as the collective rights of minorities and, for example, these minorities' claims to such things as communal land rights. While human rights remain philosophically grounded within an individualist moral doctrine, there can be no doubt that attempts are being made to adequately apply and human rights to more communally oriented societies. Human rights can no longer be accused of being 'culture-blind'.

b. Epistemological criticisms of human rights

The second most important contemporary philosophical form of human rights' criticism challenges the presumed objective basis of human rights as moral rights. This form of criticism may be thought of as a river into which run many philosophical tributaries. The essence of these attempts to refute human rights consists in the claim that moral principles and concepts are inherently subjective in character. On this view moral beliefs do not emanate from a correct determination of a rationally purposive will, or even gaining insight into the will of some divine being. Rather, moral beliefs are fundamentally expressions of individuals' partial preferences. This position therefore rejects the principal ground upon which the concept of moral rights rests: that there exist rational and a priori moral principles upon which a correct and legitimate moral doctrine is to be founded. In modern, as opposed to ancient, philosophy this argument is most closely associated with the 18th. Century Scottish philosopher David Hume. More recently versions of it have been defended by the likes of C.L.Stevenson, Ludwig Wittgenstein, J.L.Mackie, and Richard Rorty. Indeed, Rorty (1993) has argued that human rights are based not upon the exercise of reason, but a sentimental vision of humanity. He insists that human rights are not rationally defensible. He argues that one cannot justify the basis of human rights by appeal to moral theory and the canons of reason since, he insists, moral beliefs and practices are not ultimately motivated by an appeal to reason or moral theory, but emanate from a sympathetic identification with others: morality originates in the heart, and not in the head. Interestingly, though unambiguously sceptical about the philosophical basis of human rights, Rorty views the existence of human rights as a 'good and desirable thing', something whose existence we all benefit from. His critique of human rights is this not motivated by an underlying hostility to the doctrine. For Rorty, human rights are better served by emotional appeals to identify with the unnecessary suffering of others, than by arguments over the correct determination of reason.

Rorty's emphasis upon the importance of an emotional identification with others is a legitimate concern. It may, for example, provide additional support for the philosophical arguments presented by the likes of Gewirth. However, as Michael Freeman has recently pointed out, 'Rorty's argument…confuses motivation and justification. Sympathy is an emotion. Whether the action we take on the basis of our emotions is justified depends on the reasons for the action. Rorty wishes to eliminate unprovable metaphysical theories from philosophy, but in his critique of human-rights theory he goes too far, and eliminates reasoning.' (2002:56) Rorty’s own account of the basis and scope of moral knowledge ultimately prohibits him from claiming that human rights is a morally desirable phenomenon, since he explicitly rules out the validity of appealing to the independently verifiable criteria required to uphold any such judgement. What we require from Rorty is an independent reason for accepting his conclusion. It is precisely this that he denies may be legitimately provided by moral philosophy.

Rorty aside, the general critique of moral objectivity has a long and very well-established heritage in modern moral philosophy. It would be false to claim that either the objectivists or the subjectivists have scored any ultimate 'knock-down' over their philosophical opponents. Human rights are founded upon the claim to moral objectivity, whether by appeal to interests or the will. Any critique of moral objectivism is bound, therefore, to have repercussions for the philosophical defence of human rights. As I noted above, philosophers such as Alan Gewirth and John Finnis, in their separate and different ways, have attempted to establish the rational and objective force of human rights. The reader interested in pursuing this particular theme further is therefore recommended to pursue a close philosophical analysis of either, or both, of these two philosophers.

6. Conclusion

Human rights have a long historical heritage. The principal philosophical foundation of human rights is a belief in the existence of a form of justice valid for all peoples, everywhere. In this form, the contemporary doctrine of human rights has come to occupy centre stage in geo-political affairs. The language of human rights is understood and utilized by many peoples in very diverse circumstances. Human rights have become indispensable to the contemporary understanding of how human beings should be treated, by one another and by national and international political bodies. Human rights are best thought of as potential moral guarantees for each human being to lead a minimally good life. The extent to which this aspiration has not been realized represents a gross failure by the contemporary world to institute a morally compelling order based upon human rights. The philosophical basis of human rights has been subjected to consistent criticism. While some aspects of the ensuing debate between philosophical supporters and opponents of human rights remain unresolved and, perhaps, irresolvable, the general case for human rights remains a morally powerful one. Arguably, the most compelling motivation for the existence of human may rest upon the exercise of imagination. Try imagining a world without human rights!

7. References and Further Reading

  • Dworkin, Ronald. Taking Rights Seriously, (London: Duckworth, 1978)
  • Freeman, Michael. Human Rights: An Interdisciplinary Approach, (Cambridge: Polity, 2002)
  • Finnis, John. Natural Law and Natural Rights, (Oxford; Clarendon Press, 1980)
  • Gewirth, Alan. Reason and Morality, (Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1978)
  • Gewirth, Alan. Human Rights: Essays on Justification and Applications, (Chicago; University of Chicago Press, 1982)
  • Jones, Peter. Rights, (Basingstoke; Macmillan, 1994)
  • Mackie, J.L. Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong, (Harmondsworth; Penguin, 1977)
  • Nickel, James. Making Sense of Human Rights: Philosophical Reflections on the Universal Declaration of Human Rights, (Berkeley; University of California Press, 1987)
  • Rorty, Richard. "Human rights, rationality, and sentimentality". In S.Shute & S. Hurley (eds.) On Human Rights: the Oxford Amnesty Lectures 1993, (New York; Basic Books, 1993)
  • Waldron, Jeremy. Theories of Rights, (Oxford; Oxford University Press, 1984) Chapters by Ronald Dworkin, Alan Gewirth, and H.L.A.Hart

Author Information

Andrew Fagan
University of Essex
United Kingdom

Moral Development

This entry analyzes moral development as a perennial philosophical view complemented by modern empirical research programs. The two initial sections summarize what moral development is and why it is important for ethics and human nature theory. The “Roots” section notes historical versions of natural development in morality, touching on Confucius, Aristotle, Rousseau and Rawls. The next four sections assess current empirical research in moral psychology focusing on the cognitive-developmental approach of Piaget and Kohlberg and its philosophical theory. In the “Critical Specifics” section, controversies are taken up in stage theories of moral development focusing major rivalries in moral philosophy, critical and feminist theory. “Caring’s Different Voice” focuses on conflicts between justice and benevolence ethics. The “Pedagogical Implications” of moral cognition research are then summarized with a focus on classroom practices. Finally, “Related Research” is surveyed on the roles of moral perception, identity, empathy, convention/tradition, altruism and egoism, along with new moral-automaticity notions in cognitive science.

Table of Contents

  1. What it is
  2. What it is for
  3. Roots
  4. Empirical Philosophy (Cognitive-Developmentalism)
  5. Moral Stages of Reasoning
  6. Philosophical Research Method
  7. Philosophical Interpretation of Findings
  8. Critical Specifics
  9. Caring's "Different Voice"
  10. Pedagogical Implications
  11. Related Research
  12. References and Further Reading

1. What it is

Human nature is naturally good. At least it leans decidedly toward an awareness of the good, and a preference for it, over evil and injustice. Despite appearances, human nature is inherently self-realizing and self-perfecting, if in moral understanding and aspiration more than practice. Morality grows in human beings spontaneously alongside physical limbs, basic mental and social capacities. Both individually and in social interaction the human species evolves mature moral conscience and character despite the many psychological and social impediments that slow or de-rail the process for a time.

These are the basic tenets of moral development in its most vital, if naive historical form--a dominant perspective in ancient ethics and traditional religion. By painting human nature in this ultimately elevated and dignified posture, moral development visions grounded an ultimate hope in human progress. They forecast the flowering of our species' most humane and admirable potentials, leaving behind its troubled childhood.

Under critical scrutiny, moral development notions gradually surrendered their identification of human psychology with virtue. But for German idealism, however, their credibility continued to wane reaching a low ebb in the mid twentieth century when the "naturalness" of human morality seemed hardest to square with the stunning inhumanity engulfing much of the world at war. Scientifically, a continually strengthening fact-value distinction also placed “natural” and “moral” on opposite sides of the fence causing the history of moral development and perfectionist notions to seem mired in fallacy.

Only in the latter 19th century did moral development revive as a lively research field in social science led by the cognitive-developmental approach of Jean Piaget and Lawrence Kohlberg. Newfound credibility for this effort was garnered by abandoning the traditional geneticist position in moral development, which depicted even sophisticated moral reasoning as a physiologically, age-determined phenomenon. For cognitive-developmentalists, instead, natural development involves complex combinations of trial-and-error social interaction, guided only indirectly by certain implastic similarities in human motivation and basic cross-cultural institutions of social life. While these processes allow great variation in moral and quasi-moral socialization, their interaction yields remarkably similar patterns of coping. Only certain cognitive strategies seem capable of navigating basic social interaction successfully. Research suggests that the cognitive competences fueling them and their ordering in a certain sequence are practically unavoidable for functioning in human society. And these cognitive competences are decidedly moral in key and holistic respects.

2. What it is for

In human nature theory (or axiology) moral development notions convey a sense of ourselves as dynamic and progressive beings. It is normal for us to be ever-evolving and aspiring beyond ourselves even beyond the maturity of adulthood. Being potentially perfect or self-realizing, we inherit an august natural legacy to fulfill in our individual characters and through community, which reveals our hidden but awesome inherent worth. On this view, we owe it to ourselves not to sit still or languish in anything less than the full completion and perfection of all our potentials and powers.

Morally speaking, making progress in this supremely elevated cause is less daunting than its supreme end-point would suggest. We are naturally prone toward it after all. What we are obliged to do is what comes most natural to us deep down. The physical and psychological laws that govern our fundamental nature are all pulling for us, offering staunch and unremitting supporting for our journey toward ideals. For ethical perfectionism, supporting by natural development, the difficult "why be moral?" was airily brushed aside in the answer, “Because it's who we are, because it’s self-fulfilling, because it is what we are meant to be.”

But such answers raise powerful questions. If we are so ideal deep down, why are we such disappointments everywhere else? Why do we fall so characteristically short in our characters and communities, showing all manner of vice and corruption, and making a cruel and violent mess of our world?

The typical response to such telling observations comes packaged in "alienation theory." Either the outside world corrupts us—a world we can not well control. Or the inside world corrupts us. The human part of our aspiration comes freighted with, and mired in, the lustful, grasping, animal portion of our heritage, a portion not only difficult to control but bent on running us morally out of control. Or most ironic, we corrupt ourselves, conspiring unwittingly with these other corrupting influences due to the imperfect state and function of our all-too-slowly developing capacities. Our aspiring saint within is dogged not only by demons without and within, but by the natural imperfection of time needed. For most of its course development provides us only formative tools for dealing with hostilities that greet us full-formed from the start, always at the top of their game. Our ongoing inadequacies entrench themselves as habits in personality and as social institutions guiding socialization, making our already thorny path thornier still by our own misguided hand.

The alienation gambit loses perfectionist ethics its edge over competitors, sharing their disadvantages. Perfectionist principles must engage in just as much pleading and haranguing to have us walk the straight and narrow path against the stiff wind of temptation. Our development task takes on dual roles in this struggle. Building character requires clearing away the impediments to self-discipline and social righteousness. We must fight mental distractions, motivational lusts, prejudices, false ideologies, the myriad lures of false appearance and materialist obsession. With these temptations somewhat in hand, we must shine brightly forth from our natural core, "polishing our mirrors" so that unfolding capacities rise to their full level of flourishing. This pro-active urging of our spontaneous development is natural as well. Faced with the prospect of such awesome self-realization we can not just sit idly by, watching it take its natural pace, but instead offer a boost.

3. Roots

In ancient philosophies, moral development was normally conceived "teleologically." This means defining the inherent reality or essence of a moral phenomenon by the valuable function or purpose it ultimately serves. Teleology is a strong version of functionalism—x is what x does (well).

Confucian traditions attributed "four beginnings" to human personality, which naturally unfolded into defining human virtues. These were reason (which becomes moral understanding) affiliation or fellow-feeling (which transmutes into compassion), resentment (which yields a sense of justice) and feelings of guilt and shame (which become moral regret at having done wrong). Moving from initial inner drives to polished virtues in such a direct way stretches plausibility. It leaves mysterious how such socially subtle and adept abilities spring forth from such psychologically isolated and internal roots, despite all the other influences apparently at play. This contrasts with the Confucian view of how ritual institutions in society guide the careful crafting of artful behaviors.

Aristotle also focuses on habituation regarding ethical virtues. But strands of natural growth and moral evolution are embedded throughout his depiction of human flourishing. For him, ethical happiness or flourishing is the fulfillment of our natural human function. The "Aristotelean Principle" of cognitive motivation is one such strand, moving us to prefer more complex to less complex activities. This pulls us toward greater challenges and resulting cognitive growth in dealing with them over time. The development of the intellectual virtues is largely a process of natural growth toward natural function. And some of these (logos and sophrosune especially) play necessary roles in the proper expression of ethical virtues.

Aristotle's approach was more plausible because its natural growth only provided tools and tendencies for able behavior. No assumption need be made that human nature is distinctly moral. With these general abilities and sensibilities in place, social experience could pick up the developing story, shaping norm-compliant traits along and behaviors. An apparent psychological principle toward moderation leaned this process norm-compliance farther toward moral norms since many distinctly moral virtues arise at the mean between and under- and overflow of non-moral motivation.

In general, the more indirect and morally non-distinctive the view, the more plausible it depicts moral development. Developmental views of morality themselves make such an advance on earlier innatist viewpoints that locate full-blown moral insight and virtue in our souls from birth. Such views cannot explain the anomaly of moral wisdom amidst the naiveté of all other childhood beliefs, nor the failure of this wisdom to actually show itself. Likewise, direct moral development views cannot explain evolution's highly distinctive selection of such a complexly civilized and culturally mediated form of social reasoning and cooperation. Nor can they explain why peculiarly institutionalized social experience seems necessary to attain full natural edification and character.

In general, also, the logic of moral development history tells us more than its authorship, suggesting strategies for the philosophical progress on the concept. Our "inherent goodness" is best viewed as akin to genetic instructions for seeking social competence, and competence in a general sense. The basic instruction is to unpack and upgrade personality potencies as suits whichever environments will welcome their designs. Some parts of the social environment will welcome the combined expression of cognitive and social talents that enable cooperation. Some combination will be practically geared, some geared more to prudent reciprocity and mutual expectation in kind. Those that are mutually beneficial across these dimensions will progress, in a general sense of beneficial or valuable. Some will function to produce norms, and institutionalize them—norms of various sorts.

As social organization and practice moves toward beneficial divisions of labor, some norms will engender bind with traditions, other generate laws and legal systems, and some foster moral tenets of mutual fairness and respect, mutual reliance and aid. Again, each norm system endures primarily because of its respective benefits such as sense of social continuity, belonging, meaning, or worth. Our cognitive and social capacities will help shape these distinct practices and tailor their functions to them. Those that take moral shape thereby realize our inherent moral nature.

To the degree this process is unavoidable in the moral realm, and progresses in an unavoidable manner, it is natural. Yet its distinctive moral nature arises naturally, for the most part, as the fruition of its basically non-moral or morally undifferentiated path. On this indirect view, it is not that uprightness simply works in the world, as our limbs do. It is that general competencies differentiate and partner, adapting to and helping shape differentiated social environments, some of which take a moral shape and demand moral functions from them. This explains why moral tendencies would be attractive to biological selection and evolution—why our "survivalist" human psycho-biology would turn toward admirable sociality along a progressive, age-appropriate time line.

The perfectionist legacy found in writers as diverse as Augustine and Nietzche carried this indirect approach forward, more and less. Perfectionist principles urged us to develop a range of non-moral traits, serving certain individual needs and interpersonal problem-solving functions. When practiced, polished, and performed artfully together, within an artfully organized social system, these rise to the level of virtues and find their moral niche.

With the decline of teleological metaphysics and axiology, the "natural development" of morality assumed a more purely functionalist form. (Development was not pulled by a potential telos or end-point; rather it foreshadows that end-point by able handling the means to it.) Arguable, this requires that moral development be reconceived as a distributed property, crossing various domains. One might be a perfectionist ethic, a second, the functional psychology on which it rides, and, third, the adaptive needs each serves for the individual and society (Puka 1980). In such combination, moral development becomes a naturally motivated striving to fulfill those prescriptions that bid us nurture and express certain virtues. These are the virtues that, in turn, produce an effective personality and excellent overall character while fostering a thriving, progressive society.

To avoid circularity, such naturalistic views strained historically to distinguish between descriptively and normatively "natural" psychological processes—between normal and adaptive, that is. They strained further to distinguish “adaptive” from “morally apt or desirable.” And their perfectionist ethical component strained hardest to represent the transitions from minimal moral ability to high moral excellence as a smooth and homogeneous continuum. This is a stretch because excellence by its admirable nature seems extraordinary, not “natural;” it requires special efforts, not mere formative growth, to attain.

Where such straining fails, the logic of moral development falls into various fallacies, seeming to build moral norms into social and psychological ones by fiat, then trying to pass the attempt off as descriptive or factual. Efforts to avoid this outcome are worthwhile because of the valuable function moral development serves in ethics.

Any morality faces so-called strains of commitment. At base, these are strains on motivational rationality. The ultimate logical question, "Why be moral" has real-world versions: why act as I am told I should when it conflicts with what I want—with what motivates me? why struggle toward a life of integrity, when the childhood propensity to duck and weave promises an easier path to a fun-filled life? This question raises the prospect that being intellectually moral is motivationally unnatural or irrational, or even pathological. What suits our reason likely doesn't suit our full range of motivations (some stronger than reason) that reason, to be reasonable, should take into account. As noted, the most powerful psychological answer is this. “Because doing right is what is in fact most fulfilling overall: w are spontaneously drawn to it at all levels of need, desire and interest, the more so as we grow. Moral integrity produces greater self-esteem and personal satisfaction than material acquisition and social status. Thus morally we need follow our ever-increasing propensities to do what we should, exerting that little extra to bolster and stretch those propensities. The extra effort pays tenfold in making us more of what we are at our best.”

In these respects, moral development is to ethical perfectionism what psychological egoism is to ethical egoism. It renders excellent character and virtue natural, relatively easy to achieve, fulfilling, and therefore motivationally rational. Immorality does not seem so naturally desirable to us here that it must be forbidden. Instead, it presents merely tepid attraction, notable debilitation, and therefore, an undesirable cast overall. Natural development in morality, however, can serve any type of ethic, perfectionist or otherwise, providing the needed psychological resources for fulfilling whatever obligations and pursuits it recommends. Unfortunately, neither ancient teleological views of moral development nor their functionalist successors detailed the presumed processes of psycho-moral evolution. Nor did they clarify the relation of nature to nurture involved. This pointed to the need for copious empirical investigation.

Recent philosophical history gave a rare nod to moral development through Rawls's (1972) A Theory of Justice. Like Kant before him, Rawls paid homage to Rousseau’s vision of moral cooperation. Such cooperation is nature’s way of humanizing and civilizing the human race, not merely of institutionalizing humanity’s civilizing intent to stabilize and protect it. But we see in Rawls’s hands the degree to which supporting ethical prescriptions with psychological proclivities has retreated under threats from the naturalistic fallacy, and other category mistakes. Rawls recognizes only the logical requirement that just social institutions remain compatible with the facts of human psychology and its development so that socializing each successive generation in justice institutions will be a feasible enterprise, assuring compliance. He does not turn to moral development for moral support, grounding value prescriptions on its facts.

Rawls relied on a pre-scientific account of moral development (Rousseau's Emile), when an entire field of social science provided an empirically-based alternative. (This field was centered just a short stroll from Rawls’s Harvard office). We see here philosophy’s reluctance to rest enduring theory on the current state of empirical research programs. (Quine paid the price of resting the epistemology of Word and Object too heavily on the Skinnerian psychology of operant conditioning.) But we also see the skepticism and controversy that marks the research field of moral development and its guiding light, Lawrence Kohlberg. Philosophy gratefully accepted the flattering role of guide in the design of Kohlberg’s research design and the interpretation of data. But Kohlberg’s presumptive preferences for one rival philosophy over all others smacked of ideological partisanship. It raised philosophical hackles as well when Kantianism was provided empirical validation, while Utilitarianism, intuitionist virtue theory and the like were disconfirmed. Had evolution really selected Kant’s categorical imperative as our racial destiny? The title of Kohlberg’s first ethics monograph did nothing to mollify philosophical ire: "From Is to Ought: How To Commit the Naturalistic Fallacy in the Study of Moral Development and Get Away With It."

4. Empirical Philosophy (Cognitive-Developmentalism)

In contemporary terms, "moral development" is a research specialty of cognitive and developmental psychology, with associated research in anthropology, cognitive science, social and political psychology, law and education. A strong research partnership with moral theorists has marked this field's development from the outset. Researchers trace evolving systems of competence in interpreting, judging, and reasoning out moral problems. These cognitive systems incorporate empathic and social role-taking abilities that promote interpersonal negotiation, relation, and community (Selman vol. 2, Hoffman vol. 5, 7) [(References with volume numbers in the text refer to the series Moral Development: A Compendium)].

But they do not cover as much of personality, sociality, or character as the original teleological notions of human nature. Attempts to find anything like natural development in such breadth of human psychology and personality were empirically unsuccessful.

Empirical research that relies so heavily on leading philosophical conceptions, distinctions and methods of analysis cannot help but interest philosophers. Its results are highly relevant to philosophical debates, suggesting important roles for philosophy in scientific practice. The Piagetian definition of moral development's domain distinguishes fruitfully between morality, morals, ethics (as in professional codes), cultural ethos, and Ethics (as "worthy living."). Normative reasoning and reflective meta-cognition is also carefully distinguished within commonsense cognition itself. Research focuses on phenomena that have enough internal stability and cohesiveness to be said to develop--to undergo change while retaining identity and to evolve inherent, of their own accord. (This contrasts with being shaped externally, in ways that supplant an earlier version with a somewhat similar successor over time.) Great care is taken as well to demonstrate that the moral quality of observed phenomena are improving, not simply the functional sophistication of the psychological structure in which it is embedded (Kohlberg 1981).

Normative moral theory helps design the main research tools in moral development (the posing of research dilemmas and interpretation of findings). Moral-philosophical concepts are used to define empirical coding (identification) and scoring (rating) categories by issue, judgment, rationale or principle. The success of these categories suggests that the structural adequacy of moral theory derives in part from the functionality of its logic in common sense and practice. This renders those theoretical accounts of ethics that rise from "considered moral judgments" more than armchair credibility. It suggests, moreover, that difficulties faced in applying moral principles to socio-moral issues are worth the effort, and should turn out surmountable with effort. Paths have been chartered from moral judgment to theory that should be traversable in reverse direction.

Obviously, general moral principles and their logical prescriptivity indicate little in themselves about the feasibility of an ethic. Thus the philosopher must welcome any empirical account that renders reasoning a motivating and practically effective force. Moral developmentalists detail a variety of ways that conceptual competence itself motivates principled choice and action, while also partnering with moral emotions. Uncovering empirical evidence of a distinct competence-motivation principle is a great boon to theories of practical reason and intention generally, given how central conceptualization is to human competence and adaptivity. Showing a close affiliation between reasons and emotions, competence motivation and interest principles (the pleasure principle, law of effect or reinforcement) further bolsters the case.

But the philosophical bounty from moral development goes farther. A zeal for distinguishing facts from value judgments had driven modern psychology to explain morality away. Taking crudely reductionist stands, behaviorists portrayed morality as outward conformity to the prevailing ethos of one's social environment. Freudians, in turn, depicted morality as a combination of irrational forces born of biological drives, coupled with ego-defensive coping in the face of social threats and presses. These portrayals not only create a disjunct between moral philosophy and the psychology its views must ride on in practice, but between moral theory and social science generally.

Cognitive developmentalism restored the role of reason and discriminating emotion in moral choice. It provided a central role for self-determination and distinctly moral autonomy to boot. Cognitive research traces the detailed psychological processes by which children unconsciously, yet self-constructively recreate their own systems of thought and self. In so doing they resist the coercion of inherited and socialized influences enough to gain control over their thinking—to in fact use these forces as raw materials for structuring their thought. Tracing these processes provides empirical evidence of the deep, two-level sort of self-determination on which even the most rationalist and autonomy-focused philosophical ethics of Kantianism can stand. Psychology's more realistic and blended notion of "cognition" also suggests ways to overcome philosophy’s own pre-empirical divide between rationalism and emotivism or related voluntarism and determinism.

Further research on meta-cognition indicates that even common sense reasoning distinguishes between interested values, moral conventions, and autonomous morality. It depicts the former as merely interested and conventional, as morally arbitrary and relative, akin to tastes and fads. The latter, by contrast, it requires to invoke reasoned support and validating evidence (Turiel vol. 2, 4). Commonsense reasoning goes further in attributing distinctly moral responsibility to people for the self-determined choices and autonomous self-expressions they make (Blasi 2004 ).

While ancient philosophical views placed our psyches in the driver's seat of "natural development," they also provided the environment a guiding role. On this adaptation model social environment not only “watered” our inner growth, but provided the channels through which it unfolded properly. Unless society and nature stayed within the “normal,” “civil,” or even welcoming range, our personal growth and character would become stunted. With a modern psychology divided into environmentalists or geneticists on development, a cognitivist revival of the social-interactionist, moral adaptivity perspective was a crucial innovation.

5. Moral Stages of Reasoning

Jean Piaget (vol. 1) recognized the virtues of trying to reduce development either to nature or nurture. This is a tried and true theoretical research strategy in science and philosophy, reflecting the virtues of explanatory parsimony. Piagetians credited the role of socialization in developing moral ideologies and emotions. They saw the importance of guilt, shame and pride in reinforcing prevailing norms of right and wrong, also in developing ego-ideals and an aversive conscience-system to avoid censure from social authorities. But they recognized that even the most optimistic projections of such behaviorist and Freudian potential falls far short of capturing sophisticated moral deliberation and problem solving, not to mention interpersonal negotiation and relationship

Piaget introduced a third factor, the cognitive schema or system, that mediated the interplay of bio-psychology and socialization. He asked children to describe their intention and behavior, their goals and aspirations, and how they made sense of them. In this way, Piagetians have produced decades of evidence that children co-construct their moral reality much as they construct their physical reality and epistemology—organizing concepts as practical tools for interacting effectively with the world. The "tool" metaphor had special appeal when observing the continuity between using our limbs and coordinating our bodily movements in infancy, then using our conceptual categorizations of reality and coordinating their use through “logical” operations. Piagetians also demonstrated that continual enhancements to these operating systems could be depicted structurally, using the laws of propositional logic. This greatly improved the practical outlook for what seemed abstracted and overly general theory.

While tracing sequences of stages in the development of logical and scientific reasoning, however, Piaget only uncovered two somewhat cohesive systems of naturally-developing moral thought. The childhood "heteronomous" phase conditioned right and responsibility on concrete interests. It focused on conformity to approved social conventions as means of fulfilling them. The adult “autonomous phase” showed greater concern with doing the right thing per se within the framework of mutual purposes. This phase arose as children became critical and self-critical about their conventional moral beliefs and the social institutions supporting them, also as they began comparing different possible moral policies and practices with each other, intuiting the sorts of social purposes they needed to serve. The ability to intuit these purposes, even in the face of sparse and misleading information, is one of our great naturally-developing achievements. It provides intriguing support for those moral-political theorists who believe that the social contract model of ethics and just government is anything but the intellectual fiction that classical authors considered it. Still, with Piaget, it is unclear that the ancient philosophy of moral development and its inclusion within natural development of human personality had been reclaimed.

Lawrence Kohlberg determined to investigate whether there was much more detail and sophistication to the natural development of moral reasoning. And he doggedly pursued this singular investigation until his death, some thirty-five years later. In drawing hundreds of colleagues into his empirical and educational mission, across the globe, he virtually established moral development as a field. Kohlberg's approach centers the field to this day, with no comparable rival but skepticism. However, much research is performed using a simpler device (DIT) developed by Rest and colleagues (2000) that also yields findings on more components of moral judgment than Kohlberg’s MJI. The continuing program of Kohlbergians and neo-Kohlbergians is best known for a moral judgment interview technique that led to a particular six-stage theory of moral judgment,also for educational programs designed to edify at-risk urban students and prison inmates, and notably, for "being controversial." Philosophers have participated actively in the moral development debate, making Kohlberg’s work both well-known and infamous in ethics. Perhaps it should be best known for being poorly understood and critiqued.

The range of philosophical critiques that some believe discredit Kohlberg suffer from two basic flaws. They do not consider the likelihood that Kohlberg's key interpretive models and claims are dispensable in his developmental theory. Nor do they try out the alternative position they favor (the position Kohlberg’s view is allegedly biased against) to see if this makes an appreciable difference for the findings involved. This violates normal philosophical policy on apt analysis. These shortfalls suggest a dismissive prejudgment of Kohlberg theory, based perhaps on prevailing intellectual ideologies. Contemporary thinking is averse to the apparent pigeon-holing of complex systems or inflexible (hierarchically) ordering of complex processes. Kohlberg’s frustratingly casual use of philosophical methods and overblown use of philosophical notions support such pre-judgment.

Even cursory observation suggests that Kohlberg's philosophical self-depictions are dispensable indeed, leaving the empirically-based core of his theory in tact, and that his assessment of findings can be performed using a range of explanatory and meta-ethical standards (Puka vol. 4, Colby, Kohlberg. et. al. 1987). Kohlberg need not claim that observed development occurs in unified stages that are hierarchically integrated and arise in invariant sequence, that they culminate in a highest stage of a particular sort, or that stage development and the morality it captures is "natural" or “universal” in any cross-cultural sense. The leading theories of cognitive, ego, and social development do not make claims of this extreme sort, and yet are held adequate and valuable without them. Philosophers should be able to distinguish a developmental theory derived from data from further claims, derived theoretically, regarding the ethical significance of certain findings.

Kohlberg's strongest and most criticized philosophical claim--that justice and rights are the central concepts of morality--is the most obviously dispensable. Kohlberg’s perennial stage descriptions center on different moral concept or theme in every stage such as prudence, benevolence, or advancing social welfare. They are even titled in this way. It was not until the fifteenth year of advancing the well-known stage theory that Kohlberg even seriously tried to find "justice operations" working in each of the stages (Colby and Kohlberg 1987).

Kohlberg's even more fundamental claim that moral development can only be chartered where morality is non-relative seems dispensable. Moral judgment can become relatively developed, as aesthetic and culinary judgment does. There are clearly more and less developed palates and tastes, which would hold for morality were it mainly a matter of taste. Perhaps the most valuable service performed by Rest and colleagues (2000) in summarizing their twenty-years of neo-Kohlbergian research is to present the data without Kohlberg’s bold claims, showing that the stage sequence remains.

6. Philosophical Research Method

Drawing from the literature of moral philosophy, Kohlberg hypothesized that justice-as-fairness was the central moral concept, also that conflict resolution and fostering mutual cooperation were its chief aims and marks of adequacy. Kohlberg thus presented experimental subjects with moral conflicts and cooperation scenarios, recording their strategies for resolving the dilemmas involved. ( In the original longitudinal study, 52 subjects from a private Chicago boy's school were interviewed every 3-4 years for 35 years (Colby and Kohlberg 1987)). Interview probe questions also challenged these strategies to uncover the subject’s highest level of ability versus present performance. Additional interview questions asked subjects to address issues of fairness, right, rights, responsibility, equality, guilt, law versus morality, values and ideals, promise-keeping and loyalty, benevolence and love in family relations and friendships (Kohlberg 1984). These dilemmas and questions provided respondents the opportunity to couch their responses at different social perspectives and within different social units, from primary and intimate relations to social-institutional and international perspectives.

After coding recorded interview responses (in logical, social, moral categories) Kohlberg and colleagues looked for patterns. They were particularly interested in whether the template of Piagetian stages could be put over the logical, social-perspectival, and moral aspects of responding. The results showed a six-stage sequence of such stages ranging from (a) a pre-conventional level in which children think egoistically or instrumentally, using each other to get what they want, through (b) a conventional level in which conformity to the institutional practices of one's peer group and society are key toward maintaining group solidarity and stability, to (c) a post-conventional level at which morality is seen as a mutually created institution serving certain shared and elevated purposes—some achieved, some still being pursued. The post-conventional level shows commonsense rationales resembling those of reciprocal respect-for-persons, rule- utilitarianism, and libertarian rights.

Kohlberg's non-empirical theorizing offended philosophical sensibilities by claiming that these findings on post-conventional morality especially support the adequacy of leading moral theories. To philosophers it seemed unlikely enough that natural selection equipped us to reproduce Kant, Mill and Locke when trying to deal with each other. Alternatively, it seemed unlikely that only these three individuals discovered and portrayed our universal moral inheritance. Claiming that the naturalistic fallacy had been overcome in this way--through a few dozens clinical interviews with Chicago school kids--also seemed a bit bold. Overlooked here is the obvious. Outside the internal debates of moral philosophers, the advisability of building general explanatory theories in a practical field like ethics is not clear. Neither is it clear that such theories can provide useful guides for choice and action. Thus hard evidence that theories further refine and elaborate thinking that works effectively on real-world moral problems should be welcome news.

Less known to philosophers are Kohlbergian observations on developmental process and its uncanny resemblance to intellectual theory building. These same observations may offer mutual support for the common sense and intellectual search for "unified theories" or understandings. The developmental process, left out of traditional accounts, starts with trial and error inquiry and experimental observation, then the differentiation of elements and observed relations among them in one's observational field. Next these elements and relations are integrated via overarching rationales or principles designed to unify them and achieve a close correspondence between cognitive and environmental structure. The correspondence achieved is gauged functionally, by testing cognition’s predictive validity in practice. Such testing is part of general processing or assimilation of information to the stage structure achieved. This expresses ongoing competence levels until discrepant information is noticed (differentiated). Such information is then assimilated reductionistically to the structure until the discrepancies become too great and numerous. Then the structure is partially loosened or disassembled (disequilibrated) so that existing rationales can work in more ad hoc fashion, piecing together novel responses where needed. Additional ad hoc operating principles are added as well until a new more unified and coherent operating structure can be formed. When it does, we have completed stage-transition. Then the process of differentiation, accommodation, integration, and assimilative equilibrium begins once more.

While all these processes are self-constructional, they all occur quite unconsciously. This says something remarkable about our pre-intellectual capacities and routines, making the trained philosophical intellect appear less effete.

7. Philosophical Interpretation of Findings

Armed with these observations on developmental stages and processes, Kohlberg derived a range of overarching. They regarded their invariant moral and psychological progression, their spontaneous (untutored) and self-constructive quality, and their universality. In addition to launching a program of cross-cultural research, Kohlberg again consulted the philosophical literature for standards of logical, normative and meta-ethical adequacy. Gauging century-old debates, Kohlberg concluded that formal Kantian criteria as less problematic than alternatives. And he installed them as measures of moral progress in development, sketching how each stage more closely fulfilled them (Kohlberg 1981).

A host of commentators later charged Kohlberg's methodology with formalist, Kantian, and liberal-egalitarian bias. Such charges have a point. Kohlberg, after all, had not experimented with using other meta-criteria for gauging moral progress. He did not show the caution of other social scientists who imported preferred theories from other disciplines, utilizing them more hypothetically and tentatively. Still, such criticism ignores the more powerful and generalizable assessment Kohlberg offered: the stage-by-stage-comparisons in which increasing completeness and inclusivity marked moral adequacy. Here each new stage of reasoning, each operating system, was shown to add a major type of principled operation that performed a vital problem-solving function. At the same time, each retained the least problematic structures and operations of all previous stages. A largely bottom-up assessment is involved here, gauging progress away from basic inadequacy and incompleteness in both psychological and moral processing. Examples would include not considering the social or interpersonal dimension of a problem, not considering the role of key values, virtues, or responsibilities that any conceptual analysis would consider relevant.

Applied to later-stage reasoning, such assessments invoke very basic and shared adequacy criteria among competing ethical outlooks. As such they match Piaget's approach to measuring mature logical reasoning. Such "formal-operational" thought shows the competence to consider all relevant causal possibilities, from the most relevant perspectives required, to address a wide range of scientific problems.

It is worth noting that Kohlberg's stage sequence likely measures up on rival meta-ethical measures, e.g., on rule-utilitarian criteria of a quasi-teleological, quasi-intuitionist form. This is true, at least, so long as the weighted utilities or rules involved stress justice and rights, as in Mill, or in Bentham’s "each is to count for one" proviso. There is good reason for preferring such a utilitarian lean as well; the perennial list of criticisms lodged against utilitarianism call for it. Utilitarianism is unable to assure minimal fairness and equality, to view such considerations and others as morally inherent and untradable, to create moral disjuncts that set upper limits on obligation and lower limits on decency, to accord proper place and protection for individual autonomy, and the like. While Kohlberg never attempted such an analysis, those criticizing the lack of one never even suggested why it would be difficult to perform.

While Kohlberg originally claimed a sixth and highest stage of moral development that put Kantian respect and individual rights first. But his research program eventually recanted this finding. Ongoing worldwide research, combined with the statistical reanalyzes of existing data, de-legitimated the significance of many Stage 6 observations, leaving too little reliable data for Stage 6 claims. This locates the highest empirical stage in Kohlberg's theory in the same place that mainstream moral philosophy finds itself after two centuries of debate—with two main competing sets of principles, one fostering the advancement of social welfare and benevolent virtues, the other a mutual respect for individual liberty. These are accompanied by several intuitive rationales concerning goods of community, interpersonal responsibility and loyalty, equal economic opportunity and toleration, and various virtues of friendship. This state of ethical affairs approaches quasi-intuitionist rule-utilitarian criteria at least as well as it approaches Kantian, deontological ones.

The presence of interpersonal and virtue rationales in later moral development is often overlooked. Indeed, Kohlberg's own stage descriptions downplay them by focusing on what is new and distinctive in each later stage of development, not on what is inclusively preserved from earlier stages. General ethical principles are the innovation in later stages because they reflect a broadened social perspective. This misleading emphasis in stage depictions was deemed necessary by the history of stage scoring system in research, Scorers constantly confounded similar moral rationales, expressed in adjacent stage terms. Thus distinctive stage-qualities had to be emphasized at each stage. Philosophical critics who do not immerse themselves within the empirical research project and its requirements miss matters of this sort completely, failing to credit ways in which an empirically-based theory can not be altered simply to serve conceptual goals such as neutrality or elegance.

8. Critical Specifics

Critics rightly fault the over-interpreted nature of Kohlberg's initial research as well as the inflated nature of his claims relative to reliable data. Qualitative research generally offers poor safeguards against an author’s peculiar interpretive preferences, helping to shape the very content of observational "data." Recognizing this, Kohlberg invited heretics and critics of his view into his central research group over time. His conceptual interpretations were radically reanalyzed in the 1980s seeking consensus among a dozen ideologically conflicting coders and scorers, working contentiously together.

Initially, Kohlberg was not careful to control either his qualitative research method or his theory-building process for biases. Ideological (liberal) and gender (male) biases proved hardest to tame. The Kohlberg program cannot legitimately be faulted simply for having a particular focus: it need not address the full diversity of relevant topics in moral psychology. But it has clearly fallen short in considering phenomena that strongly interact with those investigated, changing their nature. Certain moral emotions should have been researched that help set cognitive orientation, gather crucial information (Blum 1980), or facilitate moral self-expression and relation (Gilligan vol. 6). Empathy and compassion should have been investigated alongside cognitive role-taking and perspective-taking since, as moral competences, they are unlikely to function separately (Hoffman vol. 7). The same can be said for the relation of moral cognitive and meta-cognition at higher levels of development (Gibbs vol.4, 5). Kohlberg followed Piaget in conceiving moral development personally and psychologically, not seriously researching the phenomenon as an interpersonal or relational process above all, or one pertaining primarily to small communities. Such apparent shortfalls top a virtual catalogue of charged deficiencies, some holding particular philosophical interest.

Methodological: (1) Empirical researchers should seek their subjects' own opinions on what morality encompasses and when it progresses or sinks low. Moral relevance and adequacy should not be pre-defined by "expert" theorists on theoretical grounds exclusively, intellectually limiting the scope and determining the emphasis of research. (2) At least one survey (Gilligan and Murphy vol. 4) indicates that subjects spontaneously conceive morality as setting value priorities or aspiring toward ideals when conceiving morality, as well as defining the kind of person one is. Testing subjects’ abilities to resolve conflicts of interest doesn’t get at these (teleological) moral sensibilities. (3) The use of an all-male sample in Kohlberg’s original, central, and ongoing study of moral development is not only unacceptable by present-day research standards. Instead, given the accumulated data on gender differences, the results should be radically reinterpreted as tracing male moral development primarily, not natural or human development. (4) The stage-system model of moral development does violence to data that shows a majority of subjects scoring at two and sometimes even three adjacent “stages” (out of five). This suggests that people remain distributed across the range of their development for most of their lives in a loose confederation of rationales and beliefs. (5) Asking research subjects to first resolve a moral dilemma then give reasons for their choice does not focus on moral reasoning or problem-solving competence, but on the ability to explain or justify judgments. Such an approach can not even distinguish justification from self-deceptive rationalization.

Conceptual: (1) Due to the many cultural and epochal influences on cognition, conceptual safeguards should have been in place to assure that American research on moral development did not unduly reflect western ideology. This includes the "social contract" or “natural rights” heritage of Anglo-American ideology (Sullivan vol. 4). (2) Defining adequate moral judgments as the decisive resolution of conflicting interests or duties fails to inquire into non-decisive, non-contending moral competences and their adequacy. These might include trying to avoid or skirt moral dilemmas due to harm done some parties by resolving them, or trying to pre-empt moral dilemmas through dialogue and negotiation aimed at altering the prior interests of involved parties (Gilligan and Murphy vol. 6). (3) Interpreting moral responses in exclusively structural or systemic terms, organized by general principles, ignores intuitionist and pluralist ethical considerations. It also ignores emotional sensibilities and intelligences, thus grossly distorting the moral-development profile. (4) Focusing moral development research on reasoning, not on traits producing expressive behavior, misses what is adequacy about moral development. The observed judgment-action gap allows a highest stage reasoner to be a high-level hypocrite, self-deceiver, and cad (Straughan vol. 4). (5) A great intermixing of moral and political perspectives, as well as similar moral and political concepts seems to occur in later developmental stages, as in some philosophical theories. Do we interpret this as a natural developing competence or incompetence? It fails in cognitive differentiation, yet seemingly shares a tendency found in expert ethical theories.

Kohlbergians have often tested and accommodated the panoply of criticisms leveled at them. Thus they have come to see the dialectic of debate as the central natural developmental course of their research program. Their absorption of many critics into their research team adds credibility to this portrayal. Some critiques have not yet been addressed however, and should be. As philosophers seem unaware, however, later phases of the Kohlberg research program arguably have evolved the most psychometrically sophisticated coding and scoring system known to qualitative research (Colby and Kohlberg 1987). This system offers the most sophisticated integration available of conceptual and empirical assessments for interpreting data and drawing conclusions from it, and arguably has generated the most impressive results in of any research program in cognitive development or moral psychology by far--winning over major opponents (Kurtines and Grief vol. 4).

In addition, Kohlberg's original thirty-year study, begun with the least sophisticated methodology and fewest bias controls recently received a thorough empirical reanalysis by Edelstein and Keller (vol. 5) which surprisingly confirmed most original Kohlberg findings. As noted, twenty-years of parallel studies using a completely different research measure than Kohlberg’s also confirmed main findings (Rest, Narvaez et al 2000). Proponents of this neo-Kohlbrgian approach have detailed the role of moral structure in perceiving and interpreting moral issues, also the function of intermediate sized moral concepts and rationales that bring stage logic closer to real-life cases than universal principles do (Rest, Narvaez, Bebeau and Thoma 2000). Each year several large-scale cross-cultural studies are reported testing both Kohlbergian claims and the bias charges against them. The basic moral development sequence is verified in each (see New Research in Moral Development).

In light of such findings, philosophical critics must address a question too long delayed. If Kohlbergian stage theory is misguided and misconceived on major points, how do we explain the massive data accumulated over a half-decade that continuingly and surprisingly confirm its claims? After decades of methodological and conceptual criticism, why hasn't the depiction of moral development come close to being disconfirmed?

Critical theory can be tapped for an answer, viewing Kohlberg research as parroting the socialized ideologies of western (individualistic, male-dominated, industrialized-capitalist) societies, found in his socially brain-washed subjects. But this speaks to conceptual possibility. No competing account is offered. More, it suffers from far more of the empirical shortfalls and conceptual leaps attributed to Kohlberg by critics, condemning it by its own standards. Still, Kohlberg often warned followers not to take "those stages" too seriously. As a scientist he assumed that future research would change current findings. The depiction of moral development would be altered further when each domain of natural cognitive development was eventually integrated into a general theory of cognitive ego-development.

9. Caring's "Different Voice"

Of the more specific critiques coming from critical and cultural theory, one feminist-friendly version garnered most notice, especially outside research psychology. More noteworthy is the rare and rich alternative perspective on moral development that accompanied it: caring versus justice. Indeed, the caring theme offers an especially promising portrait of what benevolence ethics looks like on the practical level, in everyday life. As such it poses a far superior champion for the benevolence tradition than outsized views such as utilitarianism, or dated, intuitionist virtue theories. Feminism looks to virtue theory at its peril since, among other things, traditional trait theory has garnered very poor empirical backing. And the conceptualization of traditional virtues pre-dates both research psychology and the careful introspective or depth psychology that preceded it. The caring theme is researched as a set of interpretive skills and sensibilities, proclivities and habits, easily observed and verified. Further, caring is not only more realistic than its main virtue alternative, agape, but shows up such unconditional love as a kind of kindness-machismo.

Carol Gilligan (1982) argued that Kohlberg research, like Piagetian and Freudian research, reflected a male outlook on development. While occurring at the theoretical level, it also greatly infected Kohlbergian research methodology, making qualitative observations the fulfillment of prior ideological prophecy. The view of moral thinking and development that resulted—the "justice-and-rights orientation"--is over-abstracted, overly general and essentialistic. It focuses on foundational moral concepts only and on universal laws, not on a morality of social practice and interaction that its research claims to measure.. The moral orientation portrayed in Kohlbergian stages is rigid, formulaic or calculative, and legalistic. In personal life it is cold, aloof, and impersonal, if not manipulative and punitive. Its individualism urges contentiousness with vague threat of violence. These untoward qualities show in personal judgmentalism and blaming, in both social censure and legal punishment. But they also show in the demand-quality of rights-in-conflict, and in our restive resistance toward burdensome duties. Here, obligations are straightforwardly posed as moral burdens to be born, just as rights are cast as demands and “claims against” comrades. Responsibility is seen as diminishing free self expression when in care it is an opportunity for artful relation and fulfilling mutuality.

These observations on the coercive aspects of justice must strike a chord for ethicists, especially with Kantians who hold high the liberation of self-imposed moral laws. Vigilance against moralism within morality's midst is a constant for non-partisan ethics. Critical-feminist ethicists can only welcome the picture of rights and duties as clubs and shields in a battle of conflicting interests. What better fits the military model of human relations glimpsed in the masculinist "state of nature" and social contract myth underlying western ideology? Need ethics be designed for remote cooperation against mutually mistrustful and threatening strangers? Must it form an artificial bridge of relation where natural relational bonds are weak, and relational know how deficient? Or can it equally serve the needs of enhancing primary relations and spreading their scope as the expression of a natural “will-to-care?” (Noddings 1985).

Gilligan (and Noddings) argued for an unrecognized sub-theme in male moral development and a preferred and comparably valid theme among women, left out of Kohlberg's original research sample. This "care" theme focuses morality on skills of relationship—on supporting, nurturing, and being helpful, not on demanding, defending, requiring and compelling. Mature caring shows great competence in attending to others, in listening and responding sensitively to others through dialogue aimed at consensus. The inherent powers of relationship are rallied to address moral difficulties, not powers of individual ingenuity in problem solving or deliberative argumentation. As a goodness ethic, caring also emphasizes the sharing of aspirations, joys, accomplishments, and each other.

Relative to the unique longevity of the Kohlbergian program, care research remains in its infancy, as does its research methodology (Lyons, Brown, Argyris et. al. vol. 6). But even as a conceptual posit (a different voice hypothesis) care has proven extremely influential in hosts of fields spanning literature, domestic violence, leadership counseling and legal theory. It has garnered an array of serious critics in research psychology and theory (Walker, Maccoby & Greeno, Luria, Braebeck & Nunner-Winkler, Nichols, Tronto, Puka vol. 6), along with loyal devotees and defenders (Baumrind, Brown, Lyons Attanucci vol. 6). Care's very relevance to moral development remains unclear since almost no significant longitudinal research under-wrote the view originally, nor has much been added since. The three developmental levels depicted exactly parallel what Gilligan herself portrays as coping strategies—particular strategic responses to particular kinds of personal crises (Gilligan 1982, ch 4). Such phenomena differ great from general competence systems evolved for, and able at handling moral issues generally. Gilligan also depicts care levels in the format of Perryan meta-cognition, bearing more similarities to ethical and interpersonal meta-cognition than Piagetian first-order moral judgment. (Research does not show natural meta-cognitive development, apparently, in any domain, e.g., epistemological, ontological, scientific judgment, social, self-concept.). Gilligan also refers to care levels as cognitive orientations, not competence systems, which research also shows to be quite different cognitive phenomena (Perry 1968).

Indeed, care "levels" have been defended as wholly different phenomena from Kohlbergian levels or stages, despite being depicted for two decades as constituting a comparable and parallel developmental path (Brown and Tappan vol. 6). Gilligan seemingly favors the “different realities” portrayal from the outset, noting that care orientations are likely some undetermined mixture of biology, socialization, experience, reflection and cognitive construction. Indeed, they are an admitted function of masculinist, sexist socialization in part (Gilligan 1982, Intro, chs. 1 and 3). After their initial depiction, moreover, the developmental levels of caring have rarely received mention in the care literature.

To philosophers, however, placing the depictions of caring cognition alongside Kohlbergian stages points to a progressive sequence that such a benevolence ethic might take, naturally developing or not. As such, it suggests an educational curriculum that would foster current communitarian interest and cross-disciplinary feminism. The care ethic is of exceptional utility in the classroom, proving much more applicable for addressing real-world moral issues than any so-called applied ethic derived from moral philosophy or stage structure. Certainly mature care can be applied to moral issues more easily than Kohlberg's depiction of post-conventional moral reasoning. Students are struck by care’s preference for suspending judgment or making tentative and shaded judgments on moral difficulties that call out for interpersonal struggle and negotiation over time. For many, ethics seems too murky, and ethical problems too sparse on information to allow decisive, disjunctive solutions of a right-wrong, just-unjust variety.

10. Pedagogical Implications

Any developmental approach to education starts with this recognition: teachers are presenting ways to think to students who already have their own very competent ways to think. And students will use these ways of thinking to process the teacher's input. Moreover, many of the views being presented are intellectually refined versions of viewpoints the student has developed herself in more rudimentary forms. Thus classroom presentations must partner with a students’ current cognitive competence system. Their design must appeal to student views even when attempting to enhance and challenge those views, not aiming fill up empty space or reorganize badly filled space with something new or better.

Teachers who serve up material that is not geared to each student's acquired level of competence are "banging their head against a wall" to some extent. Worse, their lessons are “bouncing off”—being rejected as either incomprehensible or radically discordant with good sense. Or they are being distorted and misconceived to fit the student’s operating system. Enhancing the student’s ability to understand must work the opposite effect, urging the student’s terms of understanding to accommodate to the material’s structure, broadening its categories, adding distinct categories and interrelating them. For cognitive-moral developmentalists, this means presenting material that will unsettle current terms of understanding, urging students to construct new ones. Here the teacher can only get students to teach themselves and develop their own skills, as both psychology and ethics prescribe.

The stage or unified-system notion shows its power and utility most in this context. When philosophers present the range of post-conventional ethical or political theories in class, many students are processing them at a conventional level, thus systematically distorting them. They are not misunderstanding these views in a "factual" sense, but understanding them in different terms. This distortion is even greater when a less educated portion of the American public encounters teachings such as democratic toleration, equality before the law, separation of church and state and other constitutional principles.

Because stage structures are tightly integrated and encompassing--representing the basic meaning system of each student--class discussion also will have many students talking past each other in the same systematic sense. Arguments won by one party, or consensus achieved by two, may not at all be what it seems. Mutual miscommunication may be the rule here, not shared understanding. The same applies to citizens or voters in public discussion. Those parts of a discussion that end in greatest confusion, disagreement, and mutual dissatisfaction may be most educationally productive. And this is not simply because they provide food for reflective thought. Rather, at a deeper level, they may help initiate or exacerbate existing cognitive disequilibrium. And this will move a student toward the "accommodative reintegration" of her ideas in a higher level of understanding.

Likewise, a student whose paper is "a mess" of near-contradictory lines of thought, ad hoc rationales, and the like, may be showing a much greater degree of learning than one who presents a smooth and consistent rendering of ideas. The former student will confess, anxiously, that s/he got her or himself all mixed up, tied in knots, going this way and that. “I'm to the point where I understood the material far better when I first started.” Most likely, s/he is quite wrong. If teachers are not somehow urging and testing for such confusion and anxiety—for disequilibrated rather than equilibrated writing—they are likely falling short in enhancing fundamental student understanding. The same is true if they are not demanding the reconstruction of each student’s original and ongoing ideas in the face of challenges to them.

Many instructors likely will recognize the above phenomena in their teaching, finding this picture of them part-illuminating, part-affirming. Most ethics instructors are struck by their ability to uncover commonsense Aristotles, John Stuart Mills, Kants, Humes and Lockes in their classroom, merely by posing moral questions. Moral development findings provide a deep and systematic partial explanation of this phenomenon. Many instructors recognize that some students who "get views correct" don't have a very reflective grasp of them. Other who seem to get things wrong often are actually grappling at a much deeper level with the views. And most instructors can tell when some lectures or class discussions have no hope of getting anywhere. “The students’ minds just don’t seem open to this way of thinking.” Yes, this is precisely what developmental theory and stage unity would predict.

William Perry (1968) offers a quasi-developmental account of meta-cognitive thinking in the college years, including ethical reflection. Faculty find it useful for understanding special problems that students face when confronted with opposing conceptions of fact and value across the curriculum. For the philosopher, such confrontations occur frequently within each course. Perry's approach explicates the particular intellectual strategies students use when coping with conflicting fundamental theories. But it also indicates major shifts in student epistemic perspectives ranging from initial absolutism through a kind of relativistic functionalism. Because the account is as clinical as it is empirical in a research sense, it offers a insightful speculations on the emotions, motivations, and anxieties students experience in doing commonsense philosophy and ethics on their educational experience.

Nel Noddings (1995) poses mature caring as a model for reorganizing public schools. Students can be taught to care across the board—from the growing of plants in the classroom, through a kind of dialogue and coming to consensus with mathematical concepts, to the nurturing of friendships in class. But more, students can learn these lessons by being truly cared for by school personnel, not just respected or graded fairly. As a hospital aims to be a care-taking institution, so a school can conceive its overall mission that way, not simply transmitting education or developing student skills and the like, but supporting, nurturing, and partnering with students in every aspect of school life. That many school personnel mistakenly believe they are already doing this indicates how crucial it is to conceive care at higher developmental levels, with many differentiations and integrations, shadings and textures of adult caring given prominence. Conventional and post-conventional caring are quite different matters. Imagine what caring of this overall sort would look like in the usually anonymous setting of a college ethics course.

11. Related Research

The Kohlbergian approach to moral development has yielded hosts of cross-cultural studies bringing in the more developed cultural research methods of social anthropologists and creating some controversies regarding the issue of cultural relativism and universality (Sweder vol. 4, 7, Colby and Kohlberg 1987). Research on moral education, using Kohlberg research and theory, has taken several forms. Some measures the effects of discussing pointed moral dilemmas with students in the classroom, some measures the effect of creating "just communities" in which students can restructure their environment, making it more welcoming to morally sensitive reasoning.

The Kohlbergian approach also has spun of heretical research programs focused on the apparent development of moral conventions and traditions, independent of post-conventional reasoning development (Turiel vol. 2, 5), moral reflectivity, that occurs within seeming first-order moral judgment, not moving to the meta-cognitive level (Gibbs vol. 2), moral and political ideology, that often mires and masks moral reasoning within attitude schemes that bias its workings (Emler 1983), faith development that surprisingly mirrors moral cognition in its conceptualization of divinity and religious devotion (Fowler 1981, Oser 1980), and moral perception, one of several skills that enable the onset of moral deliberation, negotiation and reasoning (Rest, Narvaez, Bebeau & Thoma, 2000).

The Rest group offers a "four-component" model of ethical judgment that investigates many key components in true moral reasoning or problem solving, not clearly distinguished or investigated in Kohlbergian moral judgment. Narvaez has carried the moral perception component of this research to the classroom, assessing strategies for making students more sensitive to when morally-charged issues arise in daily life. She also has led attempts to integrate moral-development research with related cognitive science research on problem solving. Important new emphasis is being placed on non-deliberative aspects of moral judgment and “reasoning,” that show an immediate or automatic “rush to judgment.” These processes mark the typical, habitual way we handle routine moral decisions in daily life (Narvaez and Lapsley 2004 ).

Much research attention has been paid to the age-old problem of akrasia or weakness of will, termed the judgment-action gap by cognitive psychologists. The most progress in this area has been made by ego-developmentalists (Blasi 2004, Youniss & Damon vols. 2, 5). They suspect that our self-definitions—whether we view our sense of responsibility and character as central to who we are—most determine whether we practice what we moral preach. But many other factors seem involved, likely centered in moral emotions and attitudes, and the automaticity phenomena just noted. The important areas of moral motivation and emotion have proven the most difficult to get at empirically.

While not part of developmental research or theory, other specialties in psychology and philosophy frame moral-developmental concerns. Care research and feminist analysis can be seen in this way, as can Perry's meta-cognitive research above. Psychoanalysts have performed many interesting clinical studies on moral emotions and their motivational effects, focusing on superego functions (guilt, fear, shame, regret) and the ego-ideal (pride, emulation, aspiration, internalization). Enright (vol. 7) has conducted a remarkably enduring and progressive research program on forgiveness and its effects. Hoffman, as noted, has researched empathy most extensively.

For decades, social psychologists such as Adorno and Sherif have looked at issues of cooperation and competition, authoritarianism and democracy in various types of organizations and groups. They have developed an entire area of research, Pro-Social Development, which takes a basically amoral or non-moral look at all forms of socially conforming and contributing behavior. A formative, but largely abandoned research movement in this area investigated the conditions under which onlookers will help or fail to help strangers, accepting different costs or levels of risks for doing so (Bickman vol. 7). An industrial branch of social psychology looks at fairness issues in the workplace and the effects of greater and lesser employee control there. Damon has conducted myriad studies of fairness judgments in early childhood that point to many factors not taken covered by cognitive competence systems of their development. Related areas of personality psychology look into the motivations behind forms of moral altruism especially, trying to understand the concept of self-sacrifice and doing good for its own sake (Staub vol. 7). A very interesting program of altruism research rises directly from philosophical accounts of egoism, both psychological and ethical (Batson vol. 7).

Some of the most inspiring research in moral development charts the development and reflective motivations of everyday moral exemplars and heroes. Lawrence Blum (1988) offered important distinctions among types of extraordinarily moral individuals, which were incorporated into interview research and theory by Colby and Damon in Some Do Care. Lawrence Walker has begun a long-term research program in this area as well, which likely will help tie cognitive-moral development in education to the prominent character-education and moral-literacy movement. Character education focuses intently on the nurturing of admirable traits, attitudes, outlooks and value commitments. Without more extensive psychological research to support its traditionalist emphases on core American values, traditional virtues, and the upholding of codes and creeds, this approach flirts with the discredited approaches of early Anglo-American public school education, rife with moralistic strictures and nationalistic indoctrination.

12. References and Further Reading

The empirical research references above can be found in the seven volume series:

  • Moral Development: A Compendium. (1995). B. Puka (ed), Garland Press.
    • Classic research by Piaget and Kohlberg is contained in vols. 1 & 2 Defining Perspectives in Moral Development and Classic Research in Moral Development. Cross-cultural and updated longitudinal research is contained in vol. 5: New Research in Moral Development. Kohlberg criticism is highlighted in vol. 4: The Great Justice Debate. Care research by Gilligan and colleagues is highlighted in vol. 6: Caring Voices and Women's Moral Frames. Research on altruism, bystander intervention, egoism, and pro-social development is focused in vol. 7: Reaching Out.

Additional References:

  • Blasi, A (2004). "Moral functioning: Moral understanding and personality" In D. K. Lapsley and D. Narvaez (Eds.), Morality, Self, and Identity Mahwah, NJ: Erlbaum.
  • Blum, L. (1988) "Moral exemplars: Reflections on Schindler, the Trocmes and others". Midwestern studies in philosophy. XII.
  • Blum, L. (1980 ) Friendship, Altruism and Morality. Boston: Routledge Kegan-Paul.
  • Colby, A., Kohlberg, L., Speicher-Dubin, B, Hewer, A., Candee, D., Gibbs, & Power, C. (1987) The Measurement of Moral Judgment.
  • Colby,A. & Damon, W. (1993) Some Do Care. NY: Free Press.
  • Confucius. (1979). The Analects. New York: Penguin Classics.
  • Emler, N., Resnick, S. & Malone, B. (1982). "The relationship between moral rasoning and political orientation". Journal of Personality and Social Psychology, 45 1073-1080.
  • Fowler, J. (1981). Stages of Faith. San Francisco: Harper and Row.
  • Gilligan, C. (1982). In a Different Voice. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Kohlberg, L. (1981). Essays in Moral Development: The Philosophy of Moral Development. (1984). The Psychology of Moral Development. New York: Harper and Row.
  • Narvaez, D. & Lapsley, D (2004, in press) S. Bend, Indiana: Notre Dame University Press.
  • Noddings, N. (1985). Caring: A Feminine Approach to Ethics and Moral Education. Los Angeles: University of California Press Press.
  • Noddings, N. (1995). The Challenge to Care in the Schools. Los Angeles: University of California Press.
  • Oser, F. (1980). Stages if religious judgment. In J. Fowler and A. Vergote (eds.) Toward Moral and Religious Maturity. Morristonw, NJ: Silver Burdett.
  • Perry, W. (1968). Forms of Intellectual and Ethical Development During the College Years. New York: Rinehart & Winston.
  • Puka, B. (1980). Toward Moral Perfectionism. NY: Garland Press.
  • Rawls, J (1971). A Theory of Justice. Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press. Rest. J. Narvaez, D., Thoma, S and Bebeau, M. Post-Conventional Moral Reasoning: A Neo-Kohlbergian Approach (2000). Mahway, NJ: Erlbaum Press..
  • Salovey, P. & Mayer, J.D. (1990). "Emotional intelligence," Imagination, Cognition, and Personality 9 185-211.

Author Information

William Puka
Rensselaer Polytechnic Institute
U. S. A.


Nihilism is the belief that all values are baseless and that nothing can be known or communicated. It is often associated with extreme pessimism and a radical skepticism that condemns existence. A true nihilist would believe in nothing, have no loyalties, and no purpose other than, perhaps, an impulse to destroy. While few philosophers would claim to be nihilists, nihilism is most often associated with Friedrich Nietzsche who argued that its corrosive effects would eventually destroy all moral, religious, and metaphysical convictions and precipitate the greatest crisis in human history. In the 20th century, nihilistic themes--epistemological failure, value destruction, and cosmic purposelessness--have preoccupied artists, social critics, and philosophers. Mid-century, for example, the existentialists helped popularize tenets of nihilism in their attempts to blunt its destructive potential. By the end of the century, existential despair as a response to nihilism gave way to an attitude of indifference, often associated with antifoundationalism.

Table of Contents

  1. Origins
  2. Friedrich Nietzsche and Nihilism
  3. Existential Nihilism
  4. Antifoundationalism and Nihilism
  5. Conclusion

1. Origins

"Nihilism" comes from the Latin nihil, or nothing, which means not anything, that which does not exist. It appears in the verb "annihilate," meaning to bring to nothing, to destroy completely. Early in the nineteenth century, Friedrich Jacobi used the word to negatively characterize transcendental idealism. It only became popularized, however, after its appearance in Ivan Turgenev's novel Fathers and Sons (1862) where he used "nihilism" to describe the crude scientism espoused by his character Bazarov who preaches a creed of total negation.

In Russia, nihilism became identified with a loosely organized revolutionary movement (C.1860-1917) that rejected the authority of the state, church, and family. In his early writing, anarchist leader Mikhael Bakunin (1814-1876) composed the notorious entreaty still identified with nihilism: "Let us put our trust in the eternal spirit which destroys and annihilates only because it is the unsearchable and eternally creative source of all life--the passion for destruction is also a creative passion!" (Reaction in Germany, 1842). The movement advocated a social arrangement based on rationalism and materialism as the sole source of knowledge and individual freedom as the highest goal. By rejecting man's spiritual essence in favor of a solely materialistic one, nihilists denounced God and religious authority as antithetical to freedom. The movement eventually deteriorated into an ethos of subversion, destruction, and anarchy, and by the late 1870s, a nihilist was anyone associated with clandestine political groups advocating terrorism and assassination.

The earliest philosophical positions associated with what could be characterized as a nihilistic outlook are those of the Skeptics. Because they denied the possibility of certainty, Skeptics could denounce traditional truths as unjustifiable opinions. When Demosthenes (c.371-322 BC), for example, observes that "What he wished to believe, that is what each man believes" (Olynthiac), he posits the relational nature of knowledge. Extreme skepticism, then, is linked to epistemological nihilism which denies the possibility of knowledge and truth; this form of nihilism is currently identified with postmodern antifoundationalism. Nihilism, in fact, can be understood in several different ways. Political Nihilism, as noted, is associated with the belief that the destruction of all existing political, social, and religious order is a prerequisite for any future improvement. Ethical nihilism or moral nihilism rejects the possibility of absolute moral or ethical values. Instead, good and evil are nebulous, and values addressing such are the product of nothing more than social and emotive pressures. Existential nihilism is the notion that life has no intrinsic meaning or value, and it is, no doubt, the most commonly used and understood sense of the word today.

Max Stirner's (1806-1856) attacks on systematic philosophy, his denial of absolutes, and his rejection of abstract concepts of any kind often places him among the first philosophical nihilists. For Stirner, achieving individual freedom is the only law; and the state, which necessarily imperils freedom, must be destroyed. Even beyond the oppression of the state, though, are the constraints imposed by others because their very existence is an obstacle compromising individual freedom. Thus Stirner argues that existence is an endless "war of each against all" (The Ego and its Own, trans. 1907).

2. Friedrich Nietzsche and Nihilism

Among philosophers, Friedrich Nietzsche is most often associated with nihilism. For Nietzsche, there is no objective order or structure in the world except what we give it. Penetrating the façades buttressing convictions, the nihilist discovers that all values are baseless and that reason is impotent. "Every belief, every considering something-true," Nietzsche writes, "is necessarily false because there is simply no true world" (Will to Power [notes from 1883-1888]). For him, nihilism requires a radical repudiation of all imposed values and meaning: "Nihilism is . . . not only the belief that everything deserves to perish; but one actually puts one's shoulder to the plough; one destroys" (Will to Power).

The caustic strength of nihilism is absolute, Nietzsche argues, and under its withering scrutiny "the highest values devalue themselves. The aim is lacking, and 'Why' finds no answer" (Will to Power). Inevitably, nihilism will expose all cherished beliefs and sacrosanct truths as symptoms of a defective Western mythos. This collapse of meaning, relevance, and purpose will be the most destructive force in history, constituting a total assault on reality and nothing less than the greatest crisis of humanity:

What I relate is the history of the next two centuries. I describe what is coming, what can no longer come differently: the advent of nihilism. . . . For some time now our whole European culture has been moving as toward a catastrophe, with a tortured tension that is growing from decade to decade: restlessly, violently, headlong, like a river that wants to reach the end. . . . (Will to Power)

Since Nietzsche's compelling critique, nihilistic themes--epistemological failure, value destruction, and cosmic purposelessness--have preoccupied artists, social critics, and philosophers. Convinced that Nietzsche's analysis was accurate, for example, Oswald Spengler in The Decline of the West (1926) studied several cultures to confirm that patterns of nihilism were indeed a conspicuous feature of collapsing civilizations. In each of the failed cultures he examines, Spengler noticed that centuries-old religious, artistic, and political traditions were weakened and finally toppled by the insidious workings of several distinct nihilistic postures: the Faustian nihilist "shatters the ideals"; the Apollinian nihilist "watches them crumble before his eyes"; and the Indian nihilist "withdraws from their presence into himself." Withdrawal, for instance, often identified with the negation of reality and resignation advocated by Eastern religions, is in the West associated with various versions of epicureanism and stoicism. In his study, Spengler concludes that Western civilization is already in the advanced stages of decay with all three forms of nihilism working to undermine epistemological authority and ontological grounding.

In 1927, Martin Heidegger, to cite another example, observed that nihilism in various and hidden forms was already "the normal state of man" (The Question of Being). Other philosophers' predictions about nihilism's impact have been dire. Outlining the symptoms of nihilism in the 20th century, Helmut Thielicke wrote that "Nihilism literally has only one truth to declare, namely, that ultimately Nothingness prevails and the world is meaningless" (Nihilism: Its Origin and Nature, with a Christian Answer, 1969). From the nihilist's perspective, one can conclude that life is completely amoral, a conclusion, Thielicke believes, that motivates such monstrosities as the Nazi reign of terror. Gloomy predictions of nihilism's impact are also charted in Eugene Rose's Nihilism: The Root of the Revolution of the Modern Age (1994). If nihilism proves victorious--and it's well on its way, he argues--our world will become "a cold, inhuman world" where "nothingness, incoherence, and absurdity" will triumph.

3. Existential Nihilism

While nihilism is often discussed in terms of extreme skepticism and relativism, for most of the 20th century it has been associated with the belief that life is meaningless. Existential nihilism begins with the notion that the world is without meaning or purpose. Given this circumstance, existence itself--all action, suffering, and feeling--is ultimately senseless and empty.

In The Dark Side: Thoughts on the Futility of Life (1994), Alan Pratt demonstrates that existential nihilism, in one form or another, has been a part of the Western intellectual tradition from the beginning. The Skeptic Empedocles' observation that "the life of mortals is so mean a thing as to be virtually un-life," for instance, embodies the same kind of extreme pessimism associated with existential nihilism. In antiquity, such profound pessimism may have reached its apex with Hegesis. Because miseries vastly outnumber pleasures, happiness is impossible, the philosopher argues, and subsequently advocates suicide. Centuries later during the Renaissance, William Shakespeare eloquently summarized the existential nihilist's perspective when, in this famous passage near the end of Macbeth, he has Macbeth pour out his disgust for life:

Out, out, brief candle!
Life's but a walking shadow, a poor player
That struts and frets his hour upon the stage
And then is heard no more; it is a tale
Told by an idiot, full of sound and fury,
Signifying nothing.

In the twentieth century, it's the atheistic existentialist movement, popularized in France in the 1940s and 50s, that is responsible for the currency of existential nihilism in the popular consciousness. Jean-Paul Sartre's (1905-1980) defining preposition for the movement, "existence precedes essence," rules out any ground or foundation for establishing an essential self or a human nature. When we abandon illusions, life is revealed as nothing; and for the existentialists, nothingness is the source of not only absolute freedom but also existential horror and emotional anguish. Nothingness reveals each individual as an isolated being "thrown" into an alien and unresponsive universe, barred forever from knowing why yet required to invent meaning. It's a situation that's nothing short of absurd. Writing from the enlightened perspective of the absurd, Albert Camus (1913-1960) observed that Sisyphus' plight, condemned to eternal, useless struggle, was a superb metaphor for human existence (The Myth of Sisyphus, 1942).

The common thread in the literature of the existentialists is coping with the emotional anguish arising from our confrontation with nothingness, and they expended great energy responding to the question of whether surviving it was possible. Their answer was a qualified "Yes," advocating a formula of passionate commitment and impassive stoicism. In retrospect, it was an anecdote tinged with desperation because in an absurd world there are absolutely no guidelines, and any course of action is problematic. Passionate commitment, be it to conquest, creation, or whatever, is itself meaningless. Enter nihilism.

Camus, like the other existentialists, was convinced that nihilism was the most vexing problem of the twentieth century. Although he argues passionately that individuals could endure its corrosive effects, his most famous works betray the extraordinary difficulty he faced building a convincing case. In The Stranger (1942), for example, Meursault has rejected the existential suppositions on which the uninitiated and weak rely. Just moments before his execution for a gratuitous murder, he discovers that life alone is reason enough for living, a raison d'être, however, that in context seems scarcely convincing. In Caligula (1944), the mad emperor tries to escape the human predicament by dehumanizing himself with acts of senseless violence, fails, and surreptitiously arranges his own assassination. The Plague (1947) shows the futility of doing one's best in an absurd world. And in his last novel, the short and sardonic, The Fall (1956), Camus posits that everyone has bloody hands because we are all responsible for making a sorry state worse by our inane action and inaction alike. In these works and other works by the existentialists, one is often left with the impression that living authentically with the meaninglessness of life is impossible.

Camus was fully aware of the pitfalls of defining existence without meaning, and in his philosophical essay The Rebel (1951) he faces the problem of nihilism head-on. In it, he describes at length how metaphysical collapse often ends in total negation and the victory of nihilism, characterized by profound hatred, pathological destruction, and incalculable violence and death.

4. Antifoundationalism and Nihilism

By the late 20th century, "nihilism" had assumed two different castes. In one form, "nihilist" is used to characterize the postmodern person, a dehumanized conformist, alienated, indifferent, and baffled, directing psychological energy into hedonistic narcissism or into a deep ressentiment that often explodes in violence. This perspective is derived from the existentialists' reflections on nihilism stripped of any hopeful expectations, leaving only the experience of sickness, decay, and disintegration.

In his study of meaninglessness, Donald Crosby writes that the source of modern nihilism paradoxically stems from a commitment to honest intellectual openness. "Once set in motion, the process of questioning could come to but one end, the erosion of conviction and certitude and collapse into despair" (The Specter of the Absurd, 1988). When sincere inquiry is extended to moral convictions and social consensus, it can prove deadly, Crosby continues, promoting forces that ultimately destroy civilizations. Michael Novak's recently revised The Experience of Nothingness (1968, 1998) tells a similar story. Both studies are responses to the existentialists' gloomy findings from earlier in the century. And both optimistically discuss ways out of the abyss by focusing of the positive implications nothingness reveals, such as liberty, freedom, and creative possibilities. Novak, for example, describes how since WWII we have been working to "climb out of nihilism" on the way to building a new civilization.

In contrast to the efforts to overcome nihilism noted above is the uniquely postmodern response associated with the current antifoundationalists. The philosophical, ethical, and intellectual crisis of nihilism that has tormented modern philosophers for over a century has given way to mild annoyance or, more interestingly, an upbeat acceptance of meaninglessness.

French philosopher Jean-Francois Lyotard characterizes postmodernism as an "incredulity toward metanarratives," those all-embracing foundations that we have relied on to make sense of the world. This extreme skepticism has undermined intellectual and moral hierarchies and made "truth" claims, transcendental or transcultural, problematic. Postmodern antifoundationalists, paradoxically grounded in relativism, dismiss knowledge as relational and "truth" as transitory, genuine only until something more palatable replaces it (reminiscent of William James' notion of "cash value"). The critic Jacques Derrida, for example, asserts that one can never be sure that what one knows corresponds with what is. Since human beings participate in only an infinitesimal part of the whole, they are unable to grasp anything with certainty, and absolutes are merely "fictional forms."

American antifoundationalist Richard Rorty makes a similar point: "Nothing grounds our practices, nothing legitimizes them, nothing shows them to be in touch with the way things are" ("From Logic to Language to Play," 1986). This epistemological cul-de-sac, Rorty concludes, leads inevitably to nihilism. "Faced with the nonhuman, the nonlinguistic, we no longer have the ability to overcome contingency and pain by appropriation and transformation, but only the ability to recognize contingency and pain" (Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity, 1989). In contrast to Nietzsche's fears and the angst of the existentialists, nihilism becomes for the antifoundationalists just another aspect of our contemporary milieu, one best endured with sang-froid.

In The Banalization of Nihilism (1992) Karen Carr discusses the antifoundationalist response to nihilism. Although it still inflames a paralyzing relativism and subverts critical tools, "cheerful nihilism" carries the day, she notes, distinguished by an easy-going acceptance of meaninglessness. Such a development, Carr concludes, is alarming. If we accept that all perspectives are equally non-binding, then intellectual or moral arrogance will determine which perspective has precedence. Worse still, the banalization of nihilism creates an environment where ideas can be imposed forcibly with little resistance, raw power alone determining intellectual and moral hierarchies. It's a conclusion that dovetails nicely with Nietzsche's, who pointed out that all interpretations of the world are simply manifestations of will-to-power.

5. Conclusion

It has been over a century now since Nietzsche explored nihilism and its implications for civilization. As he predicted, nihilism's impact on the culture and values of the 20th century has been pervasive, its apocalyptic tenor spawning a mood of gloom and a good deal of anxiety, anger, and terror. Interestingly, Nietzsche himself, a radical skeptic preoccupied with language, knowledge, and truth, anticipated many of the themes of postmodernity. It's helpful to note, then, that he believed we could--at a terrible price--eventually work through nihilism. If we survived the process of destroying all interpretations of the world, we could then perhaps discover the correct course for humankind:

I praise, I do not reproach, [nihilism's] arrival. I believe it is one of the greatest crises, a moment of the deepest self-reflection of humanity. Whether man recovers from it, whether he becomes master of this crisis, is a question of his strength. It is possible. . . . (Complete Works Vol. 13)

Author Information

Alan Pratt
Embry-Riddle University
U. S. A.


Relativism is sometimes identified (usually by its critics) as the thesis that all points of view are equally valid. In ethics, this amounts to saying that all moralities are equally good; in epistemology it implies that all beliefs, or belief systems, are equally true. Critics of relativism typically dismiss such views as incoherent since they imply the validity even of the view that relativism is false. They also charge that such views are pernicious since they undermine the enterprise of trying to improve our ways of thinking.

Perhaps because relativism is associated with such views, few philosophers are willing to describe themselves as relativists. However, most of the leading thinkers who have been accused of relativism--for example, Ludwig Wittgenstein, Peter Winch, Thomas Kuhn, Richard Rorty, Michel Foucault, Jacques Derrida--do share a certain common ground which, while recognizably relativistic, provides a basis for more sophisticated, and perhaps more defensible, positions.

Although there are many different kinds of relativism, they all have two features in common.

(1) They all assert that one thing (e.g. moral values, beauty, knowledge, taste, or meaning) is relative to some particular framework or standpoint (e.g. the individual subject, a culture, an era, a language, or a conceptual scheme).

(2) They all deny that any standpoint is uniquely privileged over all others.

It is thus possible to classify the different types and sub-types of relativism in a fairly obvious way. The main genera of relativism can be distinguished according to the object they seek to relativize. Thus, forms of moral relativism assert the relativity of moral values; forms of epistemological relativism assert the relativity of knowledge. These genera can then be broken down into distinct species by identifying the framework to which the object in question is being relativized. For example, moral subjectivism is that species of moral relativism that relativizes moral value to the individual subject.

How controversial, and how coherent, these forms of relativism are will obviously vary according to what is being relativized to what, and in what manner. In contemporary philosophy, the most widely discussed forms of relativism are moral relativism, cognitive relativism, and aesthetic relativism.

Author Information

Emrys Westacott
Alfred University
U. S. A.

Moral Epistemology

Can we ever know that it’s wrong to torture innocent children? More generally, can we ever know, or at least have some justification for believing, whether anything is morally right or wrong, just or unjust, virtuous or vicious, noble or base, good or bad? Most of us make moral judgments every day; so most of us would like to think so. But how is such knowledge, or justification, possible? We do not seem to simply perceive moral truth, as we perceive the truth that there is a computer screen before us. We do not seem to simply understand it, as we understand that all roosters are male. And we do not seem to simply feel it, as we feel a bit hungry right now. Moral epistemology explores this problem about knowledge and justification.

First, this article explores the traditional approaches to the problem: foundationalist theories, coherentist theories, and contextualist theories. Then the article explores the non-traditional approaches: reliabilist theories, noncognitivist theories, ideal decision theories, and politicized theories. The article concludes with an introduction to naturalizing moral epistemology and to some relevant issues in metaethics.

Table of Contents

  1. Classifying Theories of Moral Epistemology
  2. Traditional Approaches
    1. Foundationalist Theories
    2. Coherentist Theories
    3. Contextualist Theories
    4. Traditional Skepticism
  3. Non-Traditional Approaches
    1. Reliabilist Theories
    2. Noncognitivist Theories
    3. Ideal Decision Theories
    4. Politicized Theories
  4. Can Moral Epistemology Be Naturalized?
  5. Moral Epistemology & Metaethics
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Classifying Theories of Moral Epistemology

Below we introduce moral epistemology in terms of eight theories of moral epistemology. We divide these in half by distinguishing traditional from non-traditional approaches. By “traditional” we intend something more precise than just “old school.” So we launch our discussion of traditional approaches by defining our sense of “traditional.”

We conclude with two more detailed discussions. First, we introduce a moral epistemic debate of considerable recent importance, the debate about whether moral epistemology can be naturalized (roughly, moved in the direction of becoming scientific). Second, we discuss moral epistemology’s broader context as a subfield of metaethics (roughly, the part of ethical theory that examines the deepest assumptions behind our moral thought); we use this final discussion to introduce the problem of what the objects of moral knowledge could be.

2. Traditional Approaches

Foundationalist theories, coherentist theories, and contextualist theories represent the traditional approaches to moral epistemology. Reliabilist theories, noncognitivist theories, ideal decision theories, and politicized theories represent non-traditional approaches. By an approach to moral epistemology, we mean either (a) an attempt to explain how we can have moral knowledge, or at least justified moral beliefs, or (b) an attempt to argue that we cannot have one or both of these. The former are more or less non-skeptical, and the latter are more or less skeptical, approaches. This allows non-skeptical and skeptical approaches to compromise at the point of saying that we can have some justification for believing, but not knowledge of, some moral truths.

Approaches to moral epistemology are traditional only if they are committed to all of the following five (two moral and three epistemic) assumptions:


  1. [Moral] Cognitivism: we have moral beliefs, and thus moral belief contents that are either true or false (but not both true and false).
  2. [Moral] Realism: there are moral facts that can correspond to what moral claims represent as being the case, such as facts about the goodness or badness of people or the rightness or wrongness of their actions.
  3. [Epistemic] The Necessity of Justified True Belief: If someone knows something, then at the very least one is justified in believing it; and it is true; and one believes it. If one is justified in believing it, then one has a decisively good reason to believe it, a reason that makes one epistemically responsible in believing it.
  4. [Epistemic] Internalism: In order to be justified in believing something and therefore in order to know it, one must have in mind the factors that reasonably ground one's right to believe it. The strongest internalist theories demand that these factors be immediately in mind, whereas the milder internalist theories demand only that they be available upon reflection. This seems to imply that one must possess (without any need for further experience or research) the grounds of good answers to all kinds of skeptics in order to be justified in believing something. However, it perhaps does not imply that one can recognize all of those reasons as such or that one can effectively articulate them.
  5. [Epistemic] The Priority of Epistemic Structure: Theories of justification must also be theories of the structure of justification in response to the regress problem, which is discussed in the section on Traditional Skepticism.

a. Foundationalist Theories

According to foundationalism, all justified beliefs are either foundational or derived. Foundational beliefs or basic beliefs possess noninferential justification; derived beliefs do not. A foundational belief does not owe its justification to logical inference from other justified beliefs. A derived belief gets its justification through inference, either directly or indirectly, from foundational beliefs.

Where can we get noninferential justification for our foundational beliefs? This is one of the most difficult questions for any foundationalist theory. The two most common answers are experience (for instance, sense perception or introspection) and reason (for instance, grasp of the self-evident through understanding). Most foundationalist moral epistemic theories go for one or the other, or some blend, of these two very general answers. The two following sorts of theories are usually conceived in foundationalist terms.

Moral Sense Theories assert the existence of a uniquely moral sense by which we perceive rightness or wrongness. According to early Scottish versions of this theory, such as those of Frances Hutcheson ([1725]) and David Hume ([1740]), the perception in question is reflexive, grounded in a kind of sentiment or feeling, which is secondary to, and attendant upon, perceiving actions or states of affairs with our ordinary senses. Sometimes moral sense theories are described as intuitionist theories; more often “intuitionism” is used only for the following.

Moral Epistemic Intuitionist theories imply that we can non-perceptually recognize some moral truths in a way that can noninferentially justify us in believing them. According to W. D. Ross, who defended perhaps the most influential classical version of the theory, some moral propositions are self-evident, so that merely understanding them produces, at least in the best people, justification for believing them. His main examples are mid-level moral generalizations such as, ‘I have a prima facie duty (an unless-overridden-by-a-stronger-duty, duty) to keep my promises’. Ross’s intuitionism is rationalist: it grounds foundational justification for moral beliefs in a rational grasp of the self-evident ([1930]; 1936). Some intuitionist theories are less obviously rationalist. For instance, A. C. Ewing thought that we have a unique ability to detect “fittingness” in responses to circumstances, which is neither as straightforwardly rationalist as Rossian intuition nor as similar to sense perception as a moral sense theory would require (1949). Most historical moral and epistemic theories imply some form of intuitionism, and even the most radical departures from tradition. For instance, some naturalized moral epistemologies claim strong analogies with intuitionism. Some writers who have recently defended versions of moral epistemic intuitionism are Robert Audi (1997, 2004), Jonathan Dancy (1993), Brad Hooker (2000), and David McNaughton (2000).

b. Coherentist Theories

According to coherentism, all justified beliefs are inferentially justified; there are no foundational beliefs. Instead, what justifies us in holding beliefs are their relations of mutual support, that is, their coherence. Justification therefore accrues to beliefs only in virtue of their membership in coherent sets, and so cannot be assessed when beliefs are evaluated singly. Coherence itself is usually taken to be, at a minimum, logical consistency. Many coherentists argue that it requires not only logical consistency, but also explanatory potency or predictive value, similar to what good scientific theories exhibit.

The most important conception of coherence in recent moral epistemology is called reflective equilibrium. John Rawls is largely responsible for the contemporary importance of this conception. He proposed it in the context of arguing for his even more famous contractarian theory of justice; but as a moral epistemic idea, we can consider it apart from that context. According to Rawls, one achieves reflective equilibrium (narrowly conceived) when, and only when, one has brought all of her judgments about the rightness or wrongness of particular actions into ultimate harmony with all of one's judgments about what it is generally or universally right or wrong to do. Reflective equilibrium is a moral epistemic ideal: Rawls does not suggest that anyone has achieved or will achieve it. Nevertheless, he thinks that one is more or less justified in holding the moral beliefs one does happen to hold according to, and in virtue of, the extent to which she approaches reflective equilibrium (1971: 48-51). Reflective equilibrium is a kind of epistemic balance across levels of generality, achieved by facing and resolving conflicts between particular and general moral beliefs by means that are supposed to sort themselves out in the long run.

Some coherentist moral epistemologists, such as Geoffrey Sayre-McCord, argue that a broader conception of reflective equilibrium, which includes balance among not only our moral beliefs but also our non-moral beliefs. For instance, Sayre-McCord thinks the broader conception is better because requiring consistency between our moral and our non-moral beliefs is likely to rule out perverse but coherent sets of moral beliefs (1996: 166-70).

c. Contextualist Theories

Among close family I take for granted certain moral beliefs that I would be hard-pressed to defend at a meeting of my philosophical colleagues. Concerning the maintenance of my car, I take for granted many things that I would not take for granted if it were a passenger jet. Epistemic contextualism seems to vindicate such practices. It is the view that justified beliefs can owe their justifications to beliefs that are (even if not justified) not in need of justification under the circumstances. Beliefs not in need of justification under the circumstances are contextually basic. Which beliefs are contextually basic in a given context depends on the sorts of considerations raised in our examples above: Who am I talking to?, How serious is it if I am wrong?, and so forth

Mark Timmons is a recent moral epistemic contextualist. He argues for a context-dependent conception of epistemic responsibility that he thinks supports (epistemic) contextualism especially well in the case of moral beliefs. In actual practice, what constitutes epistemic responsibility—for example, checking such and such counterpossibilities before believing—varies according to context. In the moral case, people are especially prone to take for granted, and thus take to be epistemically responsible, certain mid-level moral generalizations (of the sort W. D. Ross thought are intuitive) that pass current in their contexts. These thus tend to serve as contextually basic in moral belief (Timmons, 1996). Of course, how much real epistemic justification one can get by extrapolating from his epistemically responsible (even if not justified) beliefs can vary according to the truth of those beliefs. For instance, Nazis extrapolating from their peculiar, shared, anti-Semitic beliefs can get very little epistemic justification. After all, one can take the conception of epistemic justification that is accepted in one's context to be epistemically significant when it is not, just as one can (in the arguably more idealized, less realistic, foundationalist and coherentist cases) take one's beliefs to be foundational or coherent when they are not.

d. Traditional Skepticism

Each broad theory-type above is, among other things, an attempt to solve a particular skeptical problem: the regress problem of justification. The problem can be presented in the form of an argument for a general, and not specifically moral, epistemic skepticism:

  1. If all justified beliefs owe their justifications via inference to other justified beliefs, then each justified belief owes its justification to other justified beliefs which owe their justifications to still further justified beliefs, and so on. Such chains of epistemic dependence must either
    1. never end, and thus form infinite regresses of justified beliefs, or
    2. end only when the chains form closed circles.
  2. All justified beliefs owe their justifications (via inference) to other justified beliefs.
  3. So all justified beliefs owe their justifications to chains of epistemic dependence of type (a) or type (b).
  4. But, if (3), then human beings can have no justified beliefs because
    1. human beings have finite minds and are thus incapable of possessing chains of epistemic dependence of type (a);
    2. chains of epistemic dependence of type (b) add up to, at best, circular arguments; circular arguments are never good reasons to believe; so allegedly justified beliefs that fall into type (b) dependence are not really justified.
  5. Hence, human beings can have no justified beliefs.

The apparent seriousness of this problem, combined with epistemic internalism’s demand that we face it head on, leads to the “priority of epistemic structure” assumption that is essential to traditional approaches. Foundationalism and contextualism try to defeat the regress argument by offering alternatives to premise (2). Coherentism tries to defeat it by offering holistic alternatives to the linear conception of epistemic dependence at work in premises (1) and (4).

To accept the soundness of the regress argument is to become a general, extreme kind of epistemic skeptic: it is to accept that we can have no justified beliefs and, thus, no knowledge. Such general, extreme epistemic skepticism is rare. Moral epistemic skepticism, on the other hand, is relatively common. It takes either weak or strong forms. According to weak (moral epistemic) skeptical theories, we can have justification for moral beliefs but we cannot have moral knowledge: the kinds or degrees of justification involved are too weak for knowledge. According to strong skeptical theories, we cannot even have justified moral beliefs.

At least one recent, strong moral epistemic skeptic is traditional (in our sense). Walter Sinnott-Armstrong thinks that the regress argument is sound, so long as by “beliefs” we mean “moral beliefs.” Perhaps, for instance, foundationalism is a good response to the regress problem in the case of our empirical—such as our perceptual—beliefs. In any case, he does not think that foundationalism works for moral beliefs. There are no good grounds, he argues, for accepting that we have a faculty that justifies foundational moral beliefs. Every attempt to argue that we do is essentially a form of dogmatism. It is an attempt to strongly insist on our most cherished moral beliefs in order to avoid having to defend them. Coherentism and contextualism fare even worse on Sinnott-Armstrong’s appraisal. They are not even viable as general epistemologies. No matter how coherent a set of beliefs is, there are any number of equally coherent sets that are inconsistent with it. So coherentism fails to explain how beliefs, in general, can be justified. Contextualists confuse mere persuasion with argument: for example, my ability to get you to agree to certain assumptions, and thus make them contextually basic, simply has no bearing on whether they are likely to be true, and, so, on whether we are justified in believing them (Sinnott-Armstrong,1996).

3. Non-Traditional Approaches

For various reasons, many philosophers reject one or more of the essential assumptions of traditional moral epistemology. Below we briefly introduce four sample kinds of non-traditional approaches. Unlike foundationalism, coherentism, and contextualism, these theories are all potentially compatible. There could be a reliabilist, noncognitivist, ideal-decision-based, politicized theory. Some of these are even, in the end, compatible with traditional theories (or close analogues of traditional theories). They all, however, reject one or more of the traditional assumptions as starting points.

a. Reliabilist Theories

I am probably average in my ability to correctly recognize dollar bills. Yet I am also, sadly, average in my lack of understanding of the complex physical, economic, sociological, and political conditions that make dollar bills be dollar bills. Somehow I nevertheless reliably recognize and daily form practically successful beliefs about dollar bills. If I am ever justified in believing that ‘here is a dollar bill’, I do not have in mind, and am not even capable of calling to mind without further research, all of the factors that make my belief true or that would justify it. Thus I cannot be justified, if traditional epistemic internalism is right, in believing that ‘here is a dollar bill’, despite my dollar-bill-reliability. David Copp (2000), the reliabilist moral epistemologist whose example this is, wants us to see that the traditional internalist outcome seems preposterous.

Of course I am justified in believing in many cases that ‘here is a dollar bill.’ So traditional epistemic internalism must be false. It is false because, Copp thinks, it is the reliability, or lack of reliability, of the processes by which we form beliefs that justifies, or fails to justify, our beliefs; not, as epistemic internalists insist, our deep skeptic-proof insight into their truth conditions. Whether we perceive, understand, or can even recognize, how such processes are reliable in us, as epistemic internalism demands, is beside the point.

Copp proposes and defends an anti-internalist, that is, externalist, moral epistemology. He argues that we (or at least the best of us) have a reliable moral sensitivity, much as we have a reliable dollar bill sensitivity. Our relevant moral sensitivity is made up of a certain combination of (i) a heightened tendency to notice morally relevant features of a situation, such as the pain produced by burning a cat alive and the much less morally significant enjoyment that doing this might bring to a gang of thugs; (ii) a reliable tendency to draw correct moral conclusions from these features, such as the conclusion that burning the cat, under the circumstances, is morally reprehensible; and (iii) a reliable tendency to be motivated in a morally appropriate way, such as being motivated to do something, if feasible, to prevent the thugs from burning the cat alive (2000; 55-58). We can, as ethical theorists do, legitimately struggle towards the exactly right combination of (i) – (iii). However we need not understand how they are connected with truth—a highly complicated matter of societal norms that appropriately arise from societies’ struggles to meet their “needs,” according to Copp—in order for our combinations of (i) – (iii) to justify our moral beliefs (1995). We need only have combinations that reliably produce true beliefs in us, in order for our (thus produced) moral beliefs to be justified.

b. Noncognitivist Theories

In his provocative attack on traditional, speculative philosophy, Language, Truth, and Logic, A. J. Ayer wrote ([1936]: 107):

…if I say to someone, “You acted wrongly in stealing that money,” I am not stating anything more than if I had simply said, “You stole that money.” In adding that this action is wrong I am not making any further statement about it. I am simply evincing my moral disapproval of it.

According to Ayer, moral language merely expresses emotion just as “a peculiar tone of horror” or “special exclamation marks” express feelings. It does not make claims: it has no content of a sort that can be true or false. Hence [moral] cognitivism—an essential ingredient of traditional moral epistemology—is false. So, the whole enterprise of moral epistemology, that is, the study of moral knowledge, is doomed from the start: there cannot be moral beliefs or truths, and because there cannot be justified true moral beliefs, there cannot be moral knowledge.

Ayer, however, does not mean to entirely relegate the concerns of moral epistemology to the dustbin. He only means to demote them. We can accept noncognitivism and still argue that some moral feelings are more reasonable or appropriate to given kinds of circumstances than others. We can have more or less justification (although not epistemic justification) for having, or tending to have, certain moral attitudes. We can thus have better and worse moral theories.

While we might think that noncognitivism degrades ethics too much by disconnecting it from the promise of truth, we might appreciate that it allows us to non-skeptically avoid a host of messy ethical and epistemic problems associated with moral realism. According to moral realism, moral claims represent the world as being thus and so; they are true when the world really is thus and so and false when it is not. It is hard to say for moral claims, however, what “thus and so” is supposed to be. Also, the very idea that moral “claims” represent the world as being a certain way is a suspect idea. It suggests that moral talk aims, like perceptual talk, at describing. But moral talk does not seem to aim at describing; it seems to aim at prescribing. Arguably, noncognitivism can make better sense of this than realism. Noncognitivism conceives moral talk as projecting moral emotion (Ayer, [1936]) or prescription (Hare, 1989) onto a perhaps otherwise indifferent world, rather than as representing the moral features of a world which contains no moral features.

Two especially influential recent noncognitivist theories are Simon Blackburn’s “quasi-realism” and Allan Gibbard’s “norm expressivism.” Blackburn’s quasi-realism combines an account of moral value as projected value with a sophisticated attempt to vindicate the rationality of certain indispensable (to moral discourse) practices that treat moral talk as if it were cognitive (1996; 1998). Gibbard’s norm-expressivism claims that moral judgment is a species of rationality judgment constituted by expressive, as opposed to cognitive, acceptance of norms or rules that determine in the moral case whether actions are forbidden, permitted, or required (1990).

c. Ideal Decision Theories

Ideal decision theories ascribe special philosophical importance to the moral decisions of idealized persons who decide under idealized circumstances. Only some ideal decision theories are moral epistemic theories (others are non-epistemic, for example, ethical or metaethical theories), and only some of those offer whole approaches to moral epistemology. Contractarianism and the sort of approach that Richard Brandt proposes are two ideal decision theories that are sometimes conceived as whole approaches to moral epistemology.

Contractarian theories seek to ratify moral claims by appeal to the agreement of fully rational, non-biased, well-informed people in real or, more often, imagined circumstances. For instance, John Rawls famously argued that principles of justice are morally binding on members of a society if and only if they would be unanimously agreed to by rational, relevantly-well-informed people in what he calls the “original position.” The original position is an imaginary situation walled off by a “veil of ignorance,” which prevents knowledge of the particular, personal features that engender biases, such as our sexes, ages, races, special tastes, talents, handicaps, or developed moral, political, or religious outlooks. Rawls, however, was a traditional coherentist when it came to moral epistemology. He did not view his contractarian decision procedure as either an ethical theory or a moral epistemology, but rather as a way of generating authoritative principles of justice that would dovetail with the best ethical theory and the best moral epistemology (1971).

Nevertheless, others have proposed and defended contractarian theories as ethical theories and/or moral epistemologies. For instance, a contractarian ethical theory might hold that actions are morally permissible if and only if they would not be rejected in something like Rawls’s original position. Some contractarian moral epistemologists think that discerning that a moral claim would be endorsed in something like the original position can justify someone in believing it (Gauthier, 1986; Morris, 1996). Although Rawls did not hold this view, he did see his method as a kind of access to deep facts about rationality itself, facts of the sort that his more traditional moral epistemology finds ultimately decisive.

Richard Brandt suggests a different, but related, ideal decision theory. A way to demonstrate the validity of a moral system is

…to show persons that if they were factually fully informed they would want a certain sort of moral system for the whole society in which they expect to live. (1996: 207-08)

This by no means makes moral knowledge easy to come by. But it does put it on the same sort of footing as our other knowledge, since all of our other knowledge is presumably about what the facts are, and to make a claim about what the facts are is to imply something about what it is like to be fully factually informed.

d. Politicized Theories

Most recent politicized theories are feminist theories. The very idea of feminist epistemology strikes many as a mistake. What could be more impartial, and less open to political interpretation, than standards of knowledge or justified belief? We may as well talk about feminist radio repair. However, feminist epistemologists often see the very mistake they want to address in such a response. This impartiality, or pretense of impartiality, in traditional epistemology blinds it to relevant information or standpoints of oppressed classes, such as women; or at least to the narrowness and biases that it is likely to have since its assumptions, methods, and so on were conceived and developed by socially privileged white men.

Anatole France ([1894]) famously wrote: “The law, in its majestic equality, forbids the rich, as well as the poor, to sleep under bridges, to beg in the streets, and to steal bread.” His irony is Marxist: Marx thought that the impartiality of laws can blind us to the very partialities they are designed to promote. Similarly, many feminist epistemologists argue that the alleged impartiality of traditional theories of justification or knowledge can blind us to the views of the world, and perhaps in particular the moral views of the world, they are designed to promote. Foundationalism, for instance, which looks on the surface like a logically motivated response to the regress problem of justification, has been considered to be just a method for vindicating the basic tenets of the foundationalist’s world view, whatever those happen to be.

What is it that white-male-dominated, traditional moral epistemology has missed? Let’s consider three kinds of feminist answers. (1) Susan Harding (1986) argues that the epistemic standpoints, that is, perspectives from which we collect evidence, of oppressed classes are epistemically better, that is, more likely to produce true beliefs, than the epistemic standpoints of oppressor classes, especially concerning the oppressor classes’ biases. For instance, an antebellum plantation owner would miss much that would be readily apparent to his lowliest slaves. For many topics, including moral ones, he is likely to live on some sort of epistemic Cloud Nine . (2) Traditional epistemology builds its misleading impartiality on taking knowledge to be an individual, rather than a community, activity. In fact, as the relative success of science illustrates, real knowing is a community activity: its body of knowledge improves only by surviving attempts by communities to refute it. By wrongly conceiving knowledge as an individual activity, traditional epistemology merely codifies the individual biases, including sexisms, of its conceivers. (3) Traditional epistemology is non-naturalized. So, it conceives actual knowledge-ascription or justification-ascription practices as mere subjects of epistemic evaluation, never as raw material upon which to base epistemic principles. Once we reverse this trend, and go in for naturalized epistemologies (see below), we can regard the actual social and linguistic circumstances of knowledge ascriptions as starting points. Once we do that, we can have, at best, only half of a good moral epistemic theory if we ignore the special moral epistemic practices, concerns, and paradigms provided by women (as traditional moral epistemology arguably has). Feminist moral epistemologists, such as Margaret Urban Walker (1996) and Lorraine Code (2000), have been leaders in the effort to naturalize moral epistemology.

4. Can Moral Epistemology Be Naturalized?

To naturalize a philosophical subject is to somehow bring it under the purview of natural science. What this means is controversial; but it is usually thought to involve both substantial and methodological projects. Substantially, it involves attempting to confine theories to existence claims that science countenances, or could eventually countenance. Methodologically, it involves attempting to limit philosophical inquiry to methods whose validity science can, or could eventually, vindicate.

There is nothing new about attempts to affect substantial naturalization in ethics. Over two centuries ago, Jeremy Bentham ([1781]) tried to conceive moral claims as substantially about quantities of pleasure and pain, and thus as about something that might be scientifically modeled and studied. Efforts to naturalize episstemology are a more recent phenomenon, with a more methodological focus. The naturalized epistemology movement was launched by W. V. Quine (1969), who rejected the traditional epistemological project of trying to discover, through conceptual analysis, skeptic-proof, a priori conditions for knowledge or justification. He proposed, instead, that epistemology be reconceived as a branch of empirical psychology. Many of his followers propose less radical reforms. What they have in common is that they reject a fully traditional approach in favor of “…an anti-skeptical, or at least non-skeptical, empirically informed investigation of the grounds of knowledge” (Copp, 2000: 39).

The effort to naturalize moral epistemology is even more recent. Most attempts take one or more of three forms: reliabilism, feminism, and scientism (or so we will call it). Below, we say a bit about each of these and introduce two objections that naturalized moral epistemologists strive to overcome.

Some epistemic reliabilists try to naturalize epistemology, in general, by identifying epistemic justification with observable and measurable consequences: such as facts about the reliability of the various processes by which we arrive at beliefs (for example, Goldman, 1994). Their rejection of traditional epistemic internalism makes room for an anti-skeptical stance by allowing justification and even knowledge in the absence of answers to traditional skeptical problems like the regress problem. David Copp (2000), whose moral epistemic reliabilism we sketched above, conceives his reliabilism as a naturalized moral epistemology, and defends it against several objections, including those we mention below.

Feminists stand to gain from naturalized moral epistemology room to urge the relevance of their various empirical critiques of the impartiality of traditional ethics and epistemology. The traditional pretense of impartiality in epistemology was largely upheld by the traditional conception of epistemology as only susceptible to a priori investigation. Naturalized moral epistemology opens the door to, and can even privilege, the sorts of psychological and sociological facts that feminist moral epistemologists seek to call attention to.

Theories that promote scientism propose and evaluate moral epistemic theories on the basis of current scientific theory, such as current sociology, psychology, artificial intelligence, and neuroscience. For instance, Paul Churchland (2000) tries to reconceive moral epistemology so that moral knowledge has much less to do with the truth of general moral and epistemic principles than with a kind of skill by which we build and more or less ably negotiate complex brain-to-social-space relations.

One of the largest sources of objections to naturalized ethics or epistemology concerns the essential normativity (value-ladenness, prescriptivity) of both ethics and epistemology. Ethics is essentially normative because it is about what we should do, not what we do. Epistemology is essentially normative because it is about what our epistemic standards should be, not what they are. Science, on the other hand, is purely descriptive. Its subject matter—how the natural world in fact is—is not normative. How then can ethics or epistemology be brought within the purview of natural science? If we try to assimilate the naturalization of both ethics and epistemology into a naturalized moral epistemology, then the problem gets even worse: neither ethics nor epistemology can derive their essential normativity from the other.

Arguably, moral and epistemic principles must be general, in the sense that they cover indefinitely many particular instances of rightness, goodness, knowledge, and so on. Science can produce generalities, such as natural laws, on the basis of generalizing from particular observations. However, as Immanuel Kant ([1785]: 63) pointed out, in order to soundly generalize to moral [or epistemic] principles in the scientific way, one would have to already know which examples, which observations or theoretical entities, are morally relevant; and one can only know that on the basis of other general moral [or epistemic] principles. Thus, if we are limited to scientific generalization from examples, then we are trapped, unable to generate the general moral [or epistemic] principles we need in order to get started.

5. Moral Epistemology & Metaethics

Metaethics is the part of ethical theory which studies the deep, often non-moral assumptions behind our moral thought. Here are some important metaethical topics:

  1. moral epistemology;
  2. moral semantics, the study of how and what moral language means;
  3. moral ontology, the study of what sort(s) of reality underwrites the truth or reasonableness of moral claims or attitudes; and
  4. moral psychology, the study of the nature of, and relations among, moral mental states, such as morally-relevant beliefs, desires, intentions and motivations.

Such topics are difficult to pursue in a vacuum. Not only does each involve an intersection or overlap between ethical theory and some other enormous topic, their problems are often inextricably interdependent.

For instance, the problem of what the objects of moral knowledge could be is larger than moral epistemology; it is also a problem of moral ontology and moral semantics. We conclude with a brief look at this problem. We access it through the general outline of a dilemma posed by A. J. Ayer against moral cognitivism. We borrow from Michael Smith (1994) the idea of using Ayer’s dilemma as a window into recent metaethics. However, we do not closely follow Ayer in developing the details of the dilemma nor explore Smith’s more sophisticated treatment.

Ayer’s Dilemma (Ayer, [1936]: 103-06): Assume moral cognitivism. If any moral claims are true, some sort of reality—something we can think of them as representing—underwrites their truth. This reality must be either something natural or something non-natural. However, if it is something natural, then it must fall victim to G. E. Moore’s arguments against ethical naturalism. If it is something non-natural, then it must either also fall victim to Moore’s arguments against ethical naturalism or fall victim to a host of other insuperable problems. So no moral claims are true.

Obviously, Ayer’s Dilemma leans heavily on G. E. Moore’s arguments against ethical naturalism. We briefly describe two of these, consider how they also preclude some non-naturalist theories, and then give some examples of the alleged host of other insuperable problems that confront the ethical non-naturalist.

Like Moore, let's simplify by calling "the Good" whatever it is that all true moral claims collectively represent as being the case. Ethical naturalism is the view that the Good is something natural. By “natural” Moore meant “…the subject matter of the natural sciences and…psychology,” or “…all that has existed or will exist in time” ([1903]: 92). Moore’s two most famous arguments against ethical naturalism are the naturalistic fallacy argument and the open question argument. According to the naturalistic fallacy argument, any attempt to identify the Good with something natural must commit a fallacy because goodness is a normative (value-laden, prescriptive) property and because nature is decidedly non-normative (value-neutral, descriptive). According to the open question argument, good definitions “close” certain questions for competent users of the term defined. For instance, competent users of the term, “triangle,” cannot wonder whether there are any round triangles. But no identification of the Good with something natural can have this feature: competent users of “good” will always be able to wonder whether the natural states of affairs in the definition are really good, and vice versa ([1903]).

Many philosophers think that Moore’s definition of “natural” is flawed. However, this matters little for our purpose since his arguments seem to work, if they work, against ethical naturalist theories of every stripe, and against many non-natural ones. They work, if they work, against any position that identifies the Good with something non-normative, even if it is something theological.

What remains, then, is to identify the Good with something non-natural and normative. This seems to imply that the Good must be sui generis, that is, utterly unique. This is the option which, according to Ayer’s Dilemma, must fall victim to “a host of other insuperable problems.” We will briefly mention three of these. First, if the Good is sui generis, then we cannot defend the possibility of moral knowledge, since we have no independent evidence of an epistemic faculty that apprehends something as being both morally significant and utterly unique. Second, if the Good is sui generis, then knowing what is good could not provide motivation for doing what is good. Third, if the Good is sui generis, then we are left without any possible explanation for why moral properties supervene on natural (or at least non-normative) properties; that is, why we cannot conceive any difference in correct moral assessment when we cannot point to any difference in the plain facts.

Responses to Ayer’s Dilemma: One way to respond to Ayer’s Dilemma is to accept it. This leaves two alternatives: keep cognitivism and become a skeptic or, as Ayer preferred, abandon cognitivism. J. L. Mackie (1977) kept cognitivism and became a skeptic. He argued that our realm of moral discourse, just like our realm of, say, Santa Claus discourse, is nothing more nor less than a large body of false claims. Ayer ([1936]), R. M. Hare (1989), Simon Blackburn (1996, 1998), and Allan Gibbard (1990) all chose, instead, to abandon cognitivism and to defend on a noncognitivist basis the possibility of something like moral knowledge,.

Another option is to keep cognitivism and reject either the anti-naturalistic or the anti-non-naturalistic horn of the dilemma. Let’s consider post-Ayer ethical naturalist theories, first.

Some ethical naturalists think that the Good is both natural and sui generis. For instance, “Cornell Realists,” such as Nicolaus Sturgeon (1989), David Brink (1989), and Geoffrey Sayre-McCord (1988) think that every particular instantiation of the Good can be identified with a natural state of affairs, such as an instance of moral rightness with some act of kindness under a natural description. However, they think that the Good, itself, cannot be identified with anything these natural instantiations all have in common. Instead, moral properties like goodness and rightness have irreducible, and thus sui generis, explanatory power of their own.

Others think that the Good is natural and not sui generis: it reduces to some natural property or properties. For instance, Peter Railton argues that it reduces to being what we would want for us, as we really are now, to want, if we had “unqualified cognitive and imaginative powers, and full factual and nomological information about…[our]…physical and psychological constitution.” (1986: 173-74). Other “Reductionist” naturalists include Gilbert Harmon (1975); Richard Brandt (1979); David Lewis (1986); and Frank Jackson, Philip Pettit and Michael Smith (2004). Reductionist naturalists typically respond to Moore’s anti-naturalistic arguments by arguing that their reductions—that is, their identifications of the Good with something natural—are a posteriori (experience-based) identifications, rather than a priori, and thus are immune to his criticisms.

Among ethical non-naturalists we must include Moore ([1903]). He accepted that the Good is sui generis, and he argued that we have an intuitive epistemic faculty that apprehends goodness and thus grounds our beliefs about what is good or right. Although his positive view is often rejected as a reduction to absurdity of ethical non-naturalism, it has had important recent defenders, for example, Panayot Butchvarov (1989).

Most recent defenders of ethical non-naturalism reject the sui generis view, or at least Moore’s version of it. Some argue that we can tell what constitutes the telos (roughly, proper function) of something that has one, provided that we know enough about it; and thus we can know what constitutes the Good for it. The facts about telos for some things—especially the most morally considerable things, like people—cannot all be identified with something natural, at least not in anything like Moore’s sense of “natural.” (Foot, 1978; MacIntyre, 1984)

Many non-naturalists reject that the Good exists, per se, in the world that science studies, and they argue instead that it arises as a necessary byproduct of any attempt to pursue purposive, or goal-driven, rational activities—such as perceiving or understanding or inferring or deliberating or intending or acting. The Good belongs, as John McDowell (1994) says, to the “space of reasons.” Such views are capable of broadly Aristotelian, Kantian, or existentialist development. In any case, they can require that the “space of reasons” be sensitive to facts (whether natural, and thus unique to the world that science models and studies, or non-natural) and logic. The Aristotelian turn conceives the space of reasons as a product of social relations, engendered by the necessary formation of interpersonal relationships and conveyed by societally-sanctioned forms of education (McDowell, 1994; MacIntyre, 1984). The Kantian turn conceives the “space of reasons” in more individualistic terms: the choices of individuals are morally evaluable according to whether the principles implicit (or explicit) in them pass some objective test, or tests, of rationality, such as being permitted by Kant’s Categorical Imperative (Korsgaard, 1996; Audi, 2004). Finally, the existentialist turn views facts and logic as radically underdetermining the rationality of choices, a short-coming that can only be made up for by adopting some thoroughly subjective criteria, usually some kind of authenticity, or trueness to oneself (Kierkegaard, [1843]; Sartre, 1992).

6. References and Further Reading

  • Audi, Robert, Moral Knowledge and Ethical Character, Oxford: Oxford University press, 1997.
  • Audi, The Good in the Right: A Theory of Intuition and Intrinsic Value, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2004.
  • Ayer, A.J., Language, Truth and Logic [1936], New York: Dover Publications, Inc., 1952.
  • Bentham, Jeremy, The Principles of Morals and Legislation, [1781] Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books, 1988.
  • Blackburn, Simon, “Securing the Nots: Moral Epistemology for the Quasi-Realist,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Blackburn, Simon, Ruling Passions, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1998.
  • BonJour, Laurence, The Structure of Empirical Justification, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1985.
  • Brandt, Richard, “Science as a Basis for Moral Theory,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Brink, David, Moral Realism and the Foundations of Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.
  • Campbell, Richard & Hunter, Bruce, “Introduction,” eds. Richmond Campbell and Bruce Hunter, Moral Epistemology Naturalized, Calgary, Alberta: University of Calgary Press, 2000.
  • Chisholm, Roderick, The Foundations of Knowing, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1982.
  • Code, Lorraine, “Statements of Fact: Whose? Where? When?,” eds. Richmond Campbell and Bruce Hunter, Moral Epistemology Naturalized, Calgary, Alberta: University of Calgary Press, 2000.
  • Copp, David, Morality, Normativity, and Society, New York: Oxford University Press, 1995.
  • Copp, David, “Four Epistemological Challenges to Ethical Naturalism,” eds. Richmond Campbell and Bruce Hunter, Moral Epistemology Naturalized, Calgary, Alberta: University of Calgary Press, 2000.
  • Dancy, Jonathan, Moral Reasons, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 1993.
  • Dancy, Jonathan, “The Particularist’s Progress,” eds. Brad Hooker and Margaret Little, Moral Particularism, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2000.
  • Ewing, A. C., The Definition of Good, New York: The Macmillan Company, 1949.
  • Foot, Philippa, Virtues and Vices, University of California Press, 1978.
  • Gauthier, David, Morals by Agreement, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1986.
  • Gewirth, Alan, Reason and Morality, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1978.
  • Gibbard, Allan, Wise Choices, Apt Feelings, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1990.
  • Goldman, Alvin, “What is Justified Belief?” ed. by Hilary Kornblith, Epistemology Naturalized, 2nd Ed., Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1994.
  • Harding, Sandra, The Science Question in Feminism, Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1986.
  • Hare, R(ichard) M., Essays in Ethical Theory, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989.
  • Hare, R(ichard) M., “Foundationalism and Coherentism in Ethics,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Harman, Gilbert, Morality, New York: Oxford University Press, 1977.
  • Hooker, Brad, Ideal Code, Real World, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2000.
  • Hume, David, A Treatise of Human Nature, [1740] 2nd Ed., ed. by L. A. Selby-Bigge, rev. by P. H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
  • Hutcheson, Frances, An Inquiry Into the Original of Our Ideas of Beauty and Nature, [1725] New York: Garland Publishers, 1971.
  • Jackson, Frank, Pettit, Philip, and Smith, Michael; Moral Realism and the Foundations of Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
  • Kant, Immanuel, Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals [1785], tr. by Mary Gregor, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • Kierkegaard, Soren, Fear and Trembling / Repetition, tr. Howard V. Hong, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1983, pp. 54-67.
  • Korsgaard, Christine, The Sources of Normativity, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Mackie, J. L., Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong, New York: Penguin, 1977.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair, After Virtue, 2nd Ed., Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1984.
  • McDowell, John, Mind and World, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1994.
  • McNaughton, David, “Intuitionism,” Blackwell Guide to Ethical Theory, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 2000, pp. 268-287.
  • Miller, Alexander, An Introduction to Metaethics, Cambridge: Polity Press, 2003.
  • Moore, G. E., Principia Ethica, [1903], rev. edn., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Morris, Christopher, “A Contractarian Account of Moral Justification,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Quine, W.V.O., “Epistemology Naturalized,” Ontological Relativity and Other Essays, New York: Columbia University Press, 1969.
  • Railton, Peter, “Moral Realism,” Philosophical Review 95, 1986.
  • Rawls, John, A Theory of Justice, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1971.
  • Ross, W. D., The Right And The Good [1930], Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, 1988.
  • Ross, W. D., The Foundations of Ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1936.
  • Sartre, Jean-Paul, Notebook For an Ethics, [posthumous publication] tr. David Pellauer, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1992.
  • Sayre-McCord, Geoffrey, “Moral Theory and Explanatory Impotence,” Midwest Studies 12, 1988, pp. 433-57.
  • Sayre-McCord, Geoffrey, “Coherentist Epistemology and Moral Theory,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Scanlon, T. M., What We Owe to Each Other, Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press, 1998.
  • Sidgwick, Henry, The Methods of Ethics [1907], Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, 1981.
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, Walter, “Moral Skepticism and Justification,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Smith, Michael, The Moral Problem, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers Ltd, 1994.
  • Sturgeon, Nicholas, “Moral Explanations,” Essays on Moral Realism, ed. by Geoffrey Sayre-McCord, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1989, 229-55.
  • Timmons, Mark, “Outline of a Contextualist Moral Epistemology,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Walker, Margaret Urban, “Feminist Skepticism, Authority, and Transparency,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.

Author Information

Peter Tramel
United States Military Academy
U. S. A.

Albert Camus (1913—1960)

camusAlbert Camus was a French-Algerian existentialist. He was a journalist, playwright, novelist, writer of philosophical essays, and Nobel laureate. Though neither by advanced training nor profession a philosopher, Camus nevertheless through his literary works and in numerous reviews, articles, essays, and speeches made important, forceful contributions to a wide range of issues in moral philosophy – from terrorism and political violence to suicide and the death penalty. In awarding him its prize for literature in 1957, the Nobel committee cited the author’s persistent efforts to “illuminate the problem of the human conscience in our time,” and it is pre-eminently as a writer of conscience and as a champion of imaginative literature as a vehicle of philosophical insight and moral truth that Camus was honored by his own generation and is still admired today. He was at the height of his career, at work on an autobiographical novel, planning new projects for theatre, film, and television, and still seeking a solution to the lacerating political turmoil in his native Algeria, when he died tragically in an automobile accident in January, 1960.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Literary Career
  3. Camus, Philosophical Literature, and the Novel of Ideas
  4. Works
    1. Fiction
    2. Drama
    3. Essays, Letters, Prose Collections, Articles, and Reviews
  5. Philosophy
    1. Background and Influences
    2. Development
    3. Themes and Ideas
      1. The Absurd
      2. Revolt
      3. The Outsider
      4. Guilt and Innocence
      5. Christianity vs. “Paganism”
      6. Individual vs. History and Mass Culture
      7. Suicide
      8. The Death Penalty
  6. Existentialism
  7. Significance and Legacy
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Life

The writer Albert Camus was born on November 7, 1913, in Mondovi, a small village near the seaport city of Bonê (present-day Annaba) in the northeast region of French Algeria. He was the second child of Lucien Auguste Camus, a military veteran and wine-shipping clerk, and of Catherine Marie Cardona, a house-keeper and part-time factory worker. (Note: Although Camus himself believed that his father was Alsatian and a first-generation émigré, research by biographer Herbert Lottman indicates that the Camus family was originally from Bordeaux and that the first Camus to leave France for Algeria was actually the author’s great-grandfather, who in the early 19th century became part of the first wave of European colonial settlers in the new melting pot of North Africa.)

Shortly after the outbreak of WWI, when Camus was less than a year old, his father was recalled to military service and on October 11, 1914, died of shrapnel wounds suffered at the first battle of the Marne. As a child, about the only thing Camus ever learned about his father was that he had once become violently ill after witnessing a public execution. This anecdote, which surfaces in fictional form in the author’s novel L’Etranger and which is also recounted in his philosophical essay “Reflections on the Guillotine,” strongly affected Camus and influenced his own lifelong opposition to the death penalty.

After his father’s death, Camus, his mother, and older brother moved to Algiers where they lived with his maternal uncle and grandmother in her cramped second-floor apartment in the working-class district of Belcourt. Camus’ mother Catherine, who was illiterate, partially deaf, and afflicted with a speech pathology, worked in an ammunition factory and cleaned homes to help support the family. In his posthumously published autobiographical novel The First Man, Camus recalls this period of his life with a mixture of pain and affection as he describes conditions of harsh poverty (the three-room apartment had no bathroom, no electricity, and no running water) relieved by hunting trips, family outings, childhood games, and scenic flashes of sun, seashore, mountain, and desert.

Camus attended elementary school at the local Ecole Communale, and it was there that he encountered the first in a series of teacher-mentors who recognized and nurtured the young boy’s lively intelligence. These father-figures introduced him to a new world of history and imagination and to literary landscapes far beyond the dusty streets of Belcourt and working-class poverty. Though stigmatized as a pupille de la nation (that is, a war veteran’s child dependent on public welfare) and hampered by recurrent health issues, Camus distinguished himself as a student and was eventually awarded a scholarship to attend high school at the Grand Lycee. Located near the famous Kasbah district, the school brought him into close proximity with the native Moslem community and thus to an early recognition of the idea of the “outsider” that would dominate his later writings.

It was during his high school years that Camus became an avid reader (absorbing Gide, Proust, Verlaine, and Bergson, among others), learned Latin and English, and developed a lifelong interest in literature, art, theatre, and film. He also enjoyed sports, especially soccer, of which he once wrote (recalling his early experience as a goal-keeper): “I learned . . . that a ball never arrives from the direction you expected it. That helped me in later life, especially in mainland France, where nobody plays straight.” It was also during this period that Camus suffered his first serious attack of tuberculosis, a disease that was to afflict him, on and off, throughout his career.

By the time he finished his Baccalauréat degree (June, 1932), Camus was already contributing articles to Sud, a literary monthly, and looking forward to a career in journalism, the arts, or higher education. The next four years (1933-37) were an especially busy period in his life, during which he attended college, worked at odd jobs, married his first wife (Simone Hié), divorced, briefly joined the Communist party, and effectively began his professional theatrical and writing career. Among his various employments during the time were stints of routine office work (one job consisted of a Bartleby-like recording and sifting of meteorological data; another involved paper-shuffling in an auto license bureau), and one can well imagine that it was during this period that his famous conceptions of Sisyphean struggle and of heroic defiance in the face of the Absurd first began to take shape within his imagination.

In 1933 Camus enrolled at the University of Algiers to pursue his diplome d’etudes superieures, specializing in philosophy and gaining certificates in sociology and psychology along the way. In 1936 he became a co-founder along with a group of young fellow intellectuals of the Théâtre du Travail, a professional acting company specializing in drama with left-wing political themes. Camus served the company as both an actor and director and also contributed scripts, including his first published play Revolt in Asturia, a drama based on an ill-fated workers’ revolt during the Spanish Civil War. That same year Camus also earned his degree and completed his dissertation, a study of the influence of Plotinus and neo-Platonism on the thought and writings of St. Augustine.

Over the next three years Camus further established himself as an emerging author, journalist, and theatre professional. After his disillusionment with and eventual expulsion from the Communist Party, he reorganized his dramatic company and renamed it the Théâtre de l’Equipe (literally the Theater of the Team). The name change signaled a new emphasis on classic drama and avant-garde aesthetics and a shift away from labor politics and agitprop. In 1938 he joined the staff of a new daily newspaper, the Alger Républicain, where his assignments as a reporter and reviewer covered everything from contemporary European literature to local political trials. It was during this period that he also published his first two literary works – L’Envers et l’endroit (Betwixt and Between), a collection of five short semi-autobiographical and philosophical pieces (1937) and Noces (Nuptials), a series of lyrical celebrations interspersed with wistful political and philosophical reflections on North Africa and the Mediterranean.

The 1940’s witnessed Camus’ gradual ascendance to the rank of world-class literary intellectual. He started the decade as a locally acclaimed author and playwright, but a figure virtually unknown outside the city of Algiers. He ended it as an internationally recognized novelist, dramatist, journalist, philosophical essayist, and champion of freedom. This period of his life began inauspiciously – war in Europe, the occupation of France, official censorship, and a widening crackdown on left-wing journals. Camus was still without stable employment or steady income when, after marrying his second wife, Francine Faure, in December of 1940, he departed Lyons, where he had been working as a journalist, and returned to Algeria. To help make ends meet, he taught part-time (French history and geography) at a private school in Oran. All the while he was putting finishing touches to his first novel L’Etranger (The Stranger), which was finally published in 1942 to favorable critical response, including a lengthy and penetrating review by Jean-Paul Sartre. The novel propelled him into immediate literary renown.

Camus returned to France in 1942 and a year later began working for the clandestine newspaper Combat, the journalistic arm and voice of the French Resistance movement. During this period, while contending with recurrent bouts of tuberculosis, he also published Le Mythe de Sisyphe (The Myth of Sisyphus), his philosophical anatomy of suicide and the absurd, and joined Gallimard Publishing as an editor, a position he held until his death.

After the Liberation, Camus continued as editor of Combat, oversaw the production and publication of two plays, Le Malentendu (The Misunderstanding) and Caligula, and assumed a leading role in Parisian intellectual society in the company of Sartre and Simone de Beauvoir among others. In the late 40’s his growing reputation as a writer and thinker was enlarged by the publication of La Peste (The Plague), an allegorical novel and fictional parable of the Nazi Occupation and the duty of revolt, and by lecture tours to the United States and South America. In 1951 he published L’Homme Revolte (The Rebel), a reflection on the nature of freedom and rebellion and a philosophical critique of revolutionary violence. This powerful and controversial work, with its explicit condemnation of Marxism-Leninism and its emphatic denunciation of unrestrained violence as a means of human liberation, led to an eventual falling out with Sartre and to his being branded a reactionary in the view of many European Communists. Yet it also established him as an outspoken champion of individual freedom and as an impassioned critic of tyranny and terrorism, whether practiced by the Left or by the Right.

In 1956, Camus published La Chute (The Fall), the short, confessional novel, which unfortunately would be the last of his completed major works and which in the opinion of some critics is the most elegant, and most under-rated, of all his books. During this period he was still afflicted by tuberculosis and was perhaps even more sorely beset by the deteriorating political situation (which had by now escalated from demonstrations and occasional terrorist and guerilla attacks into open violence and insurrection) in his native Algeria. Camus still hoped to champion some kind of rapprochement that would allow the native Moslem population and the French pied noir minority to live together peaceably in a new de-colonized and largely integrated, if not fully independent, nation. Alas, by this point, as he himself must have painfully recognized, the odds of such an outcome were becoming increasingly unlikely.

In the fall of 1957, following publication of L’Exil et le Royaume (Exile and the Kingdom), a collection of short fiction, Camus was shocked by news that he had been awarded the Nobel prize for literature. He absorbed the announcement with mixed feelings of gratitude, humility, and amazement. On the one hand, the award was obviously a tremendous honor. On the other, not only did he feel that his friend and esteemed fellow novelist Andre Malraux was more deserving, he was also aware that the Nobel itself was widely regarded as the kind of accolade usually given to artists at the end of a long career. Yet, as he indicated in his acceptance speech at Stockholm, he considered his own career as still in mid-flight, with much yet to accomplish and even greater writing challenges ahead:

. . . Every person, and assuredly every artist, wants to be recognized. So do I. But I have been unable to comprehend your decision without comparing its resounding impact with my own actual status. A man almost young, rich only in his doubts, and with his work still in progress. . . how could such a man not feel a kind of panic at hearing the decree that transports him all of a sudden. . . to the center of a glaring spotlight? And with what feelings could he accept this honor at a time when other writers in Europe, among them the very greatest, are condemned to silence, and even at a time when the country of his birth is going through unending misery?

Of course Camus could not have known as he spoke these words that most of his writing career was in fact behind him. Over the next two years, he published articles and continued to write, produce, and direct plays, including his own adaptation of Dostoyevsky’s The Possessed. He also formulated new concepts for film and television, assumed a leadership role in a new experimental national theater, and continued to campaign for peace and a political solution in Algeria. Unfortunately, none of these latter projects would be brought to fulfillment. On January 4th of 1960, Camus died tragically in a car accident while a passenger in a vehicle driven by his friend and publisher Michel Gallimard, who also suffered fatal injuries. The author was buried in the local cemetery at Lourmarin, a village in Provencal where he and his wife and daughters had lived for nearly a decade.

Upon hearing of Camus’ death, Sartre wrote a moving eulogy in the France-Observateur, saluting his former friend and political adversary not only for his distinguished contributions to French literature but especially for the heroic moral courage and “stubborn humanism” which he brought to bear against the “massive and deformed events of the day.”

2. Literary Career

According to Sartre’s perceptive appraisal, Camus was less a novelist than a writer of philosophical tales and parables in the tradition of Voltaire. This assessment accords with Camus’ own judgment that his fictional works were not true novels (Fr. romans), a form he associated with the densely populated and richly detailed social panoramas of writers like Balzac, Tolstoy, and Proust, but rather contes (“tales”) and recits (“narratives”) combining philosophical and psychological insights.

In this respect, it is also worth noting that at no time in his career did Camus ever describe himself as a deep thinker or lay claim to the title of philosopher. Instead, he nearly always referred to himself simply, yet proudly, as un ecrivain – a writer. This is an important fact to keep in mind when assessing his place in intellectual history and in twentieth-century philosophy. For by no means does he qualify as a system-builder or theorist or even as a disciplined thinker. He was instead (and here again Sartre’s assessment is astute) a sort of all-purpose critic and modern-day philosophe: a debunker of mythologies, a critic of fraud and superstition, an enemy of terror, a voice of reason and compassion, and an outspoken defender of freedom – all in all a figure very much in the Enlightenment tradition of Voltaire and Diderot. For this reason, in assessing Camus’ career and work, it may be best simply to take him at his own word and characterize him first and foremost as a writer – advisedly attaching the epithet philosophical for sharper accuracy and definition.

3. Camus, Philosophical Literature, and the Novel of Ideas

To pin down exactly why and in what distinctive sense Camus may be termed a philosophical writer, we can begin by comparing him with other authors who have merited the designation. Right away, we can eliminate any comparison with the efforts of Lucretius and Dante, who undertook to unfold entire cosmologies and philosophical systems in epic verse. Camus obviously attempted nothing of the sort. On the other hand, we can draw at least a limited comparison between Camus and writers like Pascal, Kierkegaard, and Nietzsche – that is, with writers who were first of all philosophers or religious writers, but whose stylistic achievements and literary flair gained them a special place in the pantheon of world literature as well. Here we may note that Camus himself was very conscious of his debt to Kierkegaard and Nietzsche (especially in the style and structure of The Myth of Sisyphus and The Rebel) and that he might very well have followed in their literary-philosophical footsteps if his tuberculosis had not side-tracked him into fiction and journalism and prevented him from pursuing an academic career.

Perhaps Camus himself best defined his own particular status as a philosophical writer when he wrote (with authors like Melville, Stendhal, Dostoyevsky, and Kafka especially in mind): “The great novelists are philosophical novelists”; that is, writers who eschew systematic explanation and create their discourse using “images instead of arguments.” (The Myth of Sisyphus, p.74.)

By his own definition then Camus is a philosophical writer in the sense that he has (a) conceived his own distinctive and original world-view and (b) sought to convey that view mainly through images, fictional characters and events, and dramatic presentation rather than through critical analysis and direct discourse. He is also both a novelist of ideas and a psychological novelist. And in this respect he certainly compares most closely to Dostoyevsky and Sartre, two other writers who combine a unique and distinctly philosophical outlook, acute psychological insight, and a dramatic style of presentation. (Like Camus, Sartre was a productive playwright, and Dostoyevsky remains perhaps the most dramatic of all novelists, as Camus himself seems to have realized, having adapted both The Brothers Karamazov and The Possessed for the stage.)

4. Works

Camus’ reputation rests largely on the three novels published during his lifetime (The Stranger, The Plague, and The Fall) and on his two major philosophical essays (The Myth of Sisyphus and The Rebel). However, his body of work also includes a collection of short fiction (Exile and the Kingdom), an autobiographical novel The First Man, a number of dramatic works (most notably Caligula, The Misunderstanding, and The Just Assassins), several translations and adaptations (including new versions of works by Calderon, Lope de Vega, Dostoyevsky, and Faulkner), and a lengthy assortment of essays, prose pieces, critical reviews, transcribed speeches and interviews, articles, and works of journalism. A brief summary and description of the most important of Camus’ writings is presented below as preparation for a larger discussion of his philosophy and world-view, including his main ideas and recurrent philosophical themes.

a. Fiction

The Stranger (1942) – From its cold opening lines, “Mother died today. Or maybe yesterday; I can’t be sure,” to its bleak concluding image of a public execution set to take place beneath the “benign indifference of the universe,” Camus’ first and most famous novel takes the form of a terse, flat, first-person narrative by its main character Meursault, a very ordinary young man of unremarkable habits and unemotional affect who, inexplicably and in an almost absent-minded way, kills an Arab and then is arrested, tried, convicted, and sentenced to death. The neutral style of the novel – typical of what the critic Roland Barthes called “writing degree zero” – serves as a perfect vehicle for the descriptions and commentary of its anti-hero narrator, the ultimate “outsider” and a person who seems to observe everything, including his own life, with almost pathological detachment.

The Plague (1947) – Set in the coastal town of Oran, Camus’ second novel is the story of an outbreak of plague, traced from its subtle, insidious, unheeded beginnings through its horrible, all-encompassing, and seemingly inescapable dominion to its eventual climax and decline, all told from the viewpoint of one of the survivors. Camus made no effort to conceal the fact that his novel was partly based on and could be interpreted as an allegory or parable of the rise of Nazism and the nightmare of the Occupation. However, the plague metaphor is both more complicated and more flexible than that, extending to signify the Absurd in general as well as any calamity or disaster that tests the mettle of human beings, their endurance, solidarity, sense of responsibility, compassion, and will. At the end of the novel, the plague finally retreats, and the narrator reflects that a time of pestilence teaches “that there is more to admire in men than to despise.” But he also knows “that the plague bacillus never dies or disappears for good,” that “the day would come when, for the bane and the enlightening of men, it would rouse up its rats again” and send them forth yet once more to spread death and contagion into a happy and unsuspecting city.

The Fall (1956) – Camus’ third novel, and the last to be published during his lifetime, is, in effect, an extended dramatic monologue spoken by M. Jean-Baptiste Clamence, a dissipated, cynical, former Parisian attorney (who now calls himself a “judge-penitent”) to an unnamed auditor (and thus indirectly to the reader). Set in a seedy bar amid the night-life of Amsterdam, the work is a small masterpiece of compression and style: a confessional (and semi-autobiographical) novel, an arresting character study and psychological portrait, and at the same time a wide-ranging philosophical discourse on guilt and innocence, expiation and punishment, good and evil.

b. Drama

Caligula (1938, first produced 1945). “Men die and are not happy” – such is the complaint against the universe pronounced by the young emperor Caligula, who in Camus’ play is less the murderous lunatic, slave to incest, narcissist and megalomaniac of Roman history than a theatrical martyr-hero of the Absurd, a man who carries his philosophical quarrel with the meaninglessness of human existence to a kind of fanatical but logical extreme. Camus himself described his hero as a man “obsessed with the impossible” and willing to pervert all values and if necessary destroy himself and all those around him in the pursuit of absolute liberty. Caligula was Camus’ first attempt at portraying a figure in absolute defiance of the Absurd, and through three revisions of the play over a period of several years he eventually achieved a remarkable composite by adding touches of Sade, of revolutionary nihilism, of the Nietzschean Superman, of his own version of Sisyphus, and even of Mussolini and Hitler, to his original portrait.

c. Essays, Letters, Prose Collections, Articles, and Reviews

Betwixt and Between (1937) – This short collection of semi-autobiographical, semi-fictional, philosophical pieces might be dismissed as juvenilia and largely ignored if it were not for the fact that it represents Camus’ first attempt to formulate a coherent life-outlook and world-view. The collection, which in a way serves as a germ or starting point for the author’s later philosophy, consists of five lyrical essays. In “L’Ironie” (“Irony”), a reflection on youth and age, Camus asserts, in the manner of a young disciple of Pascal, our essential solitariness in life and death. In “Entre Oui et Non” (“Between yes and no”) he suggests that to hope is as empty and as pointless as to despair. Yet he goes beyond nihilism by positing a fundamental value to existence-in-the-world. In “La Mort dans l’ame” (Death in the soul”) he supplies a sort of existential travel review, contrasting his impressions of central and eastern Europe (which he views as purgatorial and morgue-like) with the more spontaneous life of Italy and Mediterranean culture. The piece thus affirms the author’s lifelong preference for the color and vitality of the Mediterranean world, and especially North Africa, as opposed to what he perceives as the soulless cold-heartedness of modern Europe. In “Amour de vivre” (“Love of life”) he claims there can be no love of life without despair of life and thus largely re-asserts the essentially tragic, ancient Greek view that the very beauty of human existence is largely contingent upon its brevity and fragility. The concluding essay, “L’Envers et l’endroit” (“Betwixt and between”), summarizes and re-emphasizes the basically Romantic themes of the collection as a whole: our fundamental “aloneness,” the importance of imagination and openness to experience, the imperative to “live as if . . . .”

Noces (Nuptials) (1938) – This collection of four rhapsodic narratives supplements and amplifies the youthful philosophy expressed in Betwixt and Between. That joy is necessarily intertwined with despair, that the shortness of life confers a premium on intense experience, and that the world is both beautiful and violent – these are once again Camus’ principal themes. “Summer in Algiers,” which is probably the best (and best-known) of the essays in the collection, is a lyrical, at times almost ecstatic, celebration of sea, sun, and the North African landscape. Affirming a defiantly atheistic creed, Camus concludes with one of the core ideas of his philosophy: “if there is a sin against life, it consists not so much in despairing as in hoping for another life and in eluding the implacable grandeur of this one.”

The Myth of Sisyphus (1943) – If there is a single non-fiction work that can be considered an essential or fundamental statement of Camus’ philosophy, it is this extended essay on the ethics of suicide (eventually translated and repackaged for American publication in 1955). For it is here that Camus formally introduces and fully articulates his most famous idea, the concept of the Absurd, and his equally famous image of life as a Sisyphean struggle. From its provocative opening sentence (“There is but one truly serious philosophical problem, and that is suicide”) to its stirring, paradoxical conclusion (“The struggle itself toward the heights is enough to fill a man’s heart. One must imagine Sisyphus happy”), the book has something interesting and challenging on nearly every page and is shot through with brilliant aphorisms and insights. In the end, Camus rejects suicide: the Absurd must not be evaded either by religion (“philosophical suicide”) or by annihilation (“physical suicide”); the task of living should not merely be accepted, it must be embraced.

The Rebel (1951) – Camus considered this work a continuation of the critical and philosophical investigation of the Absurd that he began with The Myth of Sisyphus. Only this time his concern is not the ethics of suicide, but the problem of murder. After introducing the view that an authentic life inevitably involves some form of conscientious moral revolt, he ends up arguing that only in rare, and in very narrowly defined, instances can political violence be morally justified. Camus’ critique of revolutionary violence and terror in this work, and particularly his caustic assessment of Marxism-Leninism (which he accused of sacrificing innocent lives on the altar of History), touched nerves throughout Europe and led to his celebrated feud with Sartre and other French leftists.

Resistance, Rebellion, and Death (1957) – This posthumous collection is of interest to students of Camus mainly because it brings together an unusual assortment of his non-fiction writings on a wide range of topics, from art and politics to the advantages of pessimism and the virtues (from a non-believer’s standpoint) of Christianity. Of special interest are two pieces that helped secure Camus’ worldwide reputation as a voice of liberty: “Letters to a German Friend” (a set of four letters originally written during the Nazi Occupation) and “Reflections on the Guillotine” (a denunciation of the death penalty cited for special mention by the Nobel committee and eventually revised and re-published as a companion essay to go with fellow death-penalty opponent Arthur Koestler’s “Reflections on Hanging”).

5. Philosophy

“More a writer than a philosopher.”

(Assessment penciled on Camus’ dissertation by his dissertation adviser.)

To re-emphasize a point made earlier, Camus considered himself first and foremost a writer (un ecrivain). And at various times in his career he also accepted the labels journalist, humanist, novelist, and even moralist. However, he apparently never felt comfortable identifying himself as a philosopher – a term he seems to have associated with rigorous academic training, systematic thinking, logical consistency, and a coherent, carefully defined doctrine or body of ideas.

This is not to suggest that Camus lacked ideas or to say that his thought cannot be considered a personal philosophy. It is simply to point out that he was not a systematic, or even a notably disciplined, thinker and that, unlike Heidegger and Sartre, for example, he showed very little interest in metaphysics and ontology (which seems to be one of the reasons he consistently denied that he was an existentialist). In short, he was not much given to speculative philosophy or any kind of abstract theorizing. His thought is instead nearly always related to current events (e.g., the Spanish War, revolt in Algeria) and is consistently grounded in down-to-earth moral and political reality.

a. Background and Influences

Though he was baptized, raised, and educated as a Catholic and invariably respectful towards the Church, Camus seems to have been a natural-born pagan who showed almost no instinct whatsoever for belief in the supernatural. Even as a youth he was more of a sun-worshipper and nature lover than a boy notable for his piety or religious faith. On the other hand, there is no denying that Christian literature and philosophy served as an important influence on his early thought and intellectual development. As a young high school student Camus studied the Bible, read and savored the Spanish mystics St. Theresa of Avila and St. John of the Cross, and was introduced to the thought of St. Augustine (who would later serve as the subject of his baccalaureate dissertation and become – as a fellow North African writer, quasi-existentialist, and conscientious observer-critic of his own life – an important lifelong influence).

In college Camus absorbed Kierkegaard (who, after Augustine, was probably the single greatest Christian influence on his thought). He also studied Schopenhauer and Nietzsche (undoubtedly the two writers who did the most to set him on his own path of defiant pessimism and atheism). Other notable influences include not only the major modern philosophers from the academic curriculum – from Descartes and Spinoza to Bergson – but also, and just as importantly, philosophical writers like Stendhal, Melville, Dostoyevsky, and Kafka.

b. Development

The two earliest expressions of Camus’ personal philosophy are his works Betwixt and Between (1937) and Nuptials (1938). Here he unfolds what is essentially a hedonistic, indeed almost primitivistic, celebration of nature and the life of the senses. In the Romantic poetic tradition of writers like Rilke and Wallace Stevens, he offers a forceful rejection of all hereafters and an emphatic embrace of the here and now. There is no salvation, he argues, no transcendence; there is only the enjoyment of consciousness and natural being. One life, this life, is enough. Sky and sea, mountain and desert, have their own beauty and magnificence and constitute a sufficient heaven.

The critic John Cruikshank termed this stage in Camus’ thinking “naïve atheism” and attributed it to his ecstatic and somewhat immature “Mediterraneanism.” “Naïve” seems an apt characterization for a philosophy that is romantically bold and uncomplicated, yet somewhat lacking in sophistication and logical clarity. On the other hand, if we keep in mind Camus’ theatrical background and preference for dramatic presentation, there may actually be more depth and complexity to his thought here than meets the eye. That is to say, just as it would be simplistic and reductive to equate Camus’ philosophy of revolt with that of his character Caligula (who is at best a kind of extreme or mad spokesperson for the author), so in the same way it is possible that the pensees and opinions presented in Nuptials and Betwixt and Between are not so much the views of Camus himself as the poetically heightened observations of an artfully crafted narrator – an exuberant alter ego who is far more spontaneous and free-spirited than his more naturally reserved and sober-minded author.

In any case, regardless of our assessment of the ideas expressed in Betwixt and Between and Nuptials, it is clear that these early writings represent an important, if comparatively raw and simple, beginning stage in Camus’ development as a thinker and that his views at this point differ markedly from his more mature philosophy in several noteworthy respects. In the first place, the Camus of Nuptials is still a young man of twenty-five, aflame with youthful joie de vivre. He favors a life of impulse and daring as it was honored and practiced in both Romantic literature and in the streets of Belcourt. Recently married and divorced, raised in poverty and in close quarters, beset with health problems, this young man develops an understandable passion for clear air, open space, colorful dreams, panoramic vistas, and the breath-taking prospects and challenges of the larger world. Consequently, the Camus of the period 1937-38 is a decidedly different writer from the Camus who will ascend the dais at Stockholm nearly twenty years later.

The young Camus, that is to say, is more of a sensualist and pleasure-seeker, more of a dandy and aesthete, than the more hardened and austere figure who will endure the Occupation while serving in the French underground. He is a writer passionate in his conviction that life ought to be lived vividly and intensely – indeed rebelliously (to use the term that will take on increasing importance in his thought). He is also a writer attracted to causes, though he is not yet the author who will become world-famous for his moral seriousness and passionate commitment to justice and freedom. All of which is understandable. After all, the Camus of the middle 1930’s had not yet witnessed and absorbed the shattering spectacle and disillusioning effects of the Spanish Civil War, the rise of Fascism, Hitlerism, and Stalinism, the coming into being of total war and weapons of mass destruction, and the terrible reign of genocide and terror that would characterize the period 1938-1945. It was under the pressure and in direct response to the events of this period that Camus’ mature philosophy – with its core set of humanistic themes and ideas – emerged and gradually took shape. That mature philosophy is no longer a “naïve” atheism, but on the contrary a very reflective and critical brand of unbelief. It is proudly and inconsolably pessimistic, but not in a polemical or overbearing way. It is unbending, hard-headed, determinedly skeptical. It is tolerant and respectful of world religious creeds, but at the same time wholly unsympathetic to them. In the end it is an affirmative philosophy that accepts and approves, and in its own way blesses, our dreadful mortality and our fundamental isolation in the world.

c. Themes and Ideas

Regardless of whether he is producing drama, fiction, or non-fiction, Camus in his mature writings nearly always takes up and re-explores the same basic philosophical issues. These recurrent topoi constitute the key components of his thought. They include themes like the Absurd, alienation, suicide, and rebellion that almost automatically come to mind whenever his name is mentioned. Hence any summary of his place in modern philosophy would be incomplete without at least a brief discussion of these ideas and how they fit together to form a distinctive and original world-view.


i. The Absurd

Even readers not closely acquainted with Camus’ works are aware of his reputation as the philosophical expositor, anatomist, and poet-apostle of the absurd. Indeed as even sit-com writers and stand-up comics apparently understand (odd fact: Camus has been used to explain episodes of Seinfeld and The Simpsons), it is largely through the thought and writings of the French-Algerian author that the concept of absurdity has become a part not only of world literature and twentieth-century philosophy, but of modern popular culture as well.

What then is meant by the notion of the absurd? Contrary to the view conveyed by popular culture, the absurd, (at least in Camus’ terms) does not simply refer to some vague perception that modern life is fraught with paradoxes, incongruities, and intellectual confusion. (Although that perception is certainly consistent with his formula.) Instead, as he himself emphasizes and tries to make clear, the absurd expresses a fundamental disharmony, a tragic incompatibility, in our existence. In effect, he argues that the absurd is the product of a collision or confrontation between our human desire for order, meaning, and purpose in life and the blank, indifferent “silence of the universe.” (“The absurd is not in man nor in the world,” Camus explains, “but in their presence together. . . it is the only bond uniting them.”)

So here we are: poor creatures desperately seeking hope and meaning in a hopeless, meaningless world. Sartre, in his essay-review of The Stranger provides an additional gloss on the idea: “The absurd, to be sure, resides neither in man nor in the world, if you consider each separately. But since man’s dominant characteristic is ‘being in the world,’ the absurd is, in the end, an inseparable part of the human condition.” The absurd, then, presents itself in the form of an existential opposition. It arises from the human demand for clarity and transcendence on the one hand and a cosmos that offers nothing of the kind on the other. Such is our fate: we inhabit a world that is indifferent to our sufferings and deaf to our protests.

In Camus’ view there are three possible philosophical responses to this predicament. Two of these he condemns as evasions; the other he puts forward as a proper solution.

Our first choice is blunt and simple: physical suicide. If we decide that a life without some essential purpose or meaning is not worth living, we can simply choose to kill ourselves. Camus rejects this choice as cowardly. In his terms it is a repudiation or renunciation of life, not a true revolt.

Choice two is the religious solution of positing a transcendent world of solace and meaning beyond the Absurd. Camus calls this solution “philosophical suicide” and rejects it as transparently evasive and fraudulent. To adopt a supernatural solution to the problem of the absurd (for example, through some type of mysticism or leap of faith) is to annihilate reason, which in Camus’ view is as fatal and self-destructive as physical suicide. In effect, instead of removing himself from the absurd confrontation of self and world like the physical suicide, the religious believer simply removes the offending world, replacing it, via a kind of metaphysical abracadabra, with a more agreeable alternative.

Choice three (in Camus’ view the only authentic and valid solution) is simply to accept absurdity, or better yet to embrace it, and to continue living. Since the absurd in his view is an unavoidable, indeed defining, characteristic of the human condition, the only proper response to it is full, unflinching, courageous acceptance. Life, he says, can “be lived all the better if it has no meaning.”

The example par excellence of this option of spiritual courage and metaphysical revolt is the mythical Sisyphus of Camus’ philosophical essay. Doomed to eternal labor at his rock, fully conscious of the essential hopelessness of his plight, Sisyphus nevertheless pushes on. In doing so he becomes for Camus a superb icon of the spirit of revolt and of the human condition. To rise each day to fight a battle you know you cannot win, and to do this with wit, grace, compassion for others, and even a sense of mission, is to face the Absurd in a spirit of true heroism.

Over the course of his career, Camus examines the Absurd from multiple perspectives and through the eyes of many different characters – from the mad Caligula, who is obsessed with the problem, to the strangely aloof and yet simultaneously self-absorbed Mersault, who seems indifferent to it even as he exemplifies and is finally victimized by it. In The Myth of Sisyphus Camus traces it in specific characters of legend and literature (Don Juan, Ivan Karamazov) and also in certain character types (the Actor, the Conqueror), all of whom may be understood as in some way a version or manifestation of Sisyphus, the archetypal absurd hero.

[Note: A rather different, yet possibly related, notion of the absurd is proposed and analyzed in the work of Kierkegaard, especially in Fear and Trembling and Repetition. For Kierkegaard, however, the absurd describes not an essential and universal human condition, but the special condition and nature of religious faith – a paradoxical state in which matters of will and perception that are objectively impossible can nevertheless be ultimately true. Though it is hard to say whether Camus had Kierkegaard particularly in mind when he developed his own concept of the absurd, there can be little doubt that Kierkegaard’s knight of faith is in certain ways an important predecessor of Camus’ Sisyphus: both figures are involved in impossible and endlessly agonizing tasks, which they nevertheless confidently and even cheerfully pursue. In the knight’s quixotic defiance and solipsism, Camus found a model for his own ideal of heroic affirmation and philosophical revolt.]

ii. Revolt

The companion theme to the Absurd in Camus’ oeuvre (and the only other philosophical topic to which he devoted an entire book) is the idea of Revolt. What is revolt? Simply defined, it is the Sisyphean spirit of defiance in the face of the Absurd. More technically and less metaphorically, it is a spirit of opposition against any perceived unfairness, oppression, or indignity in the human condition.

Rebellion in Camus’ sense begins with a recognition of boundaries, of limits that define one’s essential selfhood and thus must not be infringed – as when the slave stands up to his master and says in effect “thus far, and no further, shall I be commanded.” This defining of the self as at some point inviolable appears to be an act of pure egoism and individualism, but it is not. In fact Camus argues at some length to show that an act of conscientious revolt is ultimately far more than just an individual gesture or an act of solitary protest. The rebel, he writes, holds that there is a “common good more important than his own destiny” and that there are “rights more important than himself.” He acts “in the name of certain values which are still indeterminate but which he feels are common to himself and to all men.” (The Rebel, 15-16.)

Camus then goes on to assert that an “analysis of rebellion leads at least to the suspicion that, contrary to the postulates of contemporary thought, a human nature does exist, as the Greeks believed.” After all, “Why rebel,” he asks, “if there is nothing permanent in the self worth preserving?” The slave who stands up and asserts himself actually does so for “the sake of everyone in the world.” He declares in effect that “all men – even the man who insults and oppresses him – have a natural community.” Here we may note that the idea that there may indeed be an essential human nature was actually more than a “suspicion” as far as Camus himself was concerned. Indeed for him it was more like a fundamental article of his humanist faith. In any case it represents one of the core principles of his ethics and is one of the things that sets his philosophy apart from existentialism.

True revolt, then, is performed not just for the self but in solidarity with and out of compassion for others. And for this reason, Camus is led to conclude, that revolt too has its limits. If it begins with and necessarily involves a recognition of human community and a common human dignity, it cannot, without betraying its own true character, treat others as if they were lacking in that dignity or not a part of that community. In the end it is remarkable, and indeed surprising, how closely Camus’ philosophy of revolt, despite the author’s fervent atheism and individualism, echoes Kantian ethics with its prohibition against treating human beings as means and its ideal of the human community as a kingdom of ends.

iii. The Outsider

A recurrent theme in Camus’ literary works, which also shows up in his moral and political writings, is the character or perspective of the “stranger” or outsider. Mersault, the laconic narrator of The Stranger, is the most obvious example. He seems to observe everything, even his own behavior, from an outside perspective. Like an anthropologist, he records his observations with clinical detachment at the same time that he himself is warily observed by the community around him.

Camus came by this perspective naturally. As a European in Africa, an African in Europe, an infidel among Moslems, a lapsed Catholic, a Communist Party drop-out, an underground resister (who at times had to use code names and false identities), a “child of the state” raised by a widowed mother (who was illiterate and virtually deaf and dumb), Camus lived most of his life in various groups and communities without really being of them. This outside view, the perspective of the exile, became his characteristic stance as a writer. It explains both the cool, objective (“zero-degree”) precision of much of his work and also the high value he assigned to longed-for ideals of friendship, community, solidarity, and brotherhood.

iv. Guilt and Innocence

Throughout his writing career, Camus showed a deep interest in questions of guilt and innocence. Once again Mersault in The Stranger provides a striking example. Is he legally innocent of the murder he is charged with? Or is he technically guilty? On the one hand, there seems to have been no conscious intention behind his action. Indeed the killing takes place almost as if by accident, with Mersault in a kind of absent-minded daze, distracted by the sun. From this point of view, his crime seems surreal and his trial and subsequent conviction a travesty. On the other hand, it is hard for the reader not to share the view of other characters in the novel, especially Mersault’s accusers, witnesses, and jury, in whose eyes he seems to be a seriously defective human being – a kind of hollow man at best; at worst a monster of self-centeredness and insularity. That the character has evoked such a wide range of responses from critics and readers – from sympathy to horror – is a tribute to the psychological complexity and subtlety of Camus’ portrait.

Camus’ brilliantly crafted final novel, The Fall, continues his keen interest in the theme of guilt, this time via a narrator who is virtually obsessed with it. The significantly named Jean-Baptiste Clamence (a voice in the wilderness calling for universal clemency and forgiveness) is tortured by guilt in the wake of a seemingly casual incident. While strolling home one drizzly November evening, he shows little concern and almost no emotional reaction at all to the suicidal plunge of a young woman into the Seine. But afterwards the incident begins to gnaw at him, and eventually he comes to view his inaction as typical of a long pattern of personal vanity and as a colossal failure of human sympathy on his part. Wracked by remorse and self-loathing, he gradually descends into a figurative hell. Formerly an attorney, he is now a self-described “judge-penitent” (a combination sinner, tempter, prosecutor, and father-confessor), who shows up each night at his local haunt, a sailor’s bar near Amsterdam’s red light district, where, somewhat in the manner of Coleridge’s Ancient Mariner, he recounts his story to whoever will hear it. In the final sections of the novel, amid distinctly Christian imagery and symbolism, he declares his crucial insight that, despite our pretensions to righteousness, everyone is guilty. Hence no human being has the right to pass final moral judgment on another.

In a final twist, Clamence asserts that his acid self-portrait is also a mirror for his contemporaries. Hence his confession is also an accusation – not only of his nameless companion (who serves as the mute auditor for his monologue) but ultimately of the hypocrite lecteur as well.

v. Christianity vs. “Paganism”

The theme of guilt and innocence in Camus’ writings relates closely to another recurrent tension in his thought: the opposition of Christian and pagan ideas and influences. At heart a nature-worshipper, and by instinct a skeptic and non-believer, Camus nevertheless retained a lifelong interest and respect for Christian philosophy and literature. In particular, he seems to have recognized St. Augustine and Kierkegaard as intellectual kinsmen and writers with whom he shared a common passion for controversy, literary flourish, self-scrutiny, and self-dramatization. Christian images, symbols, and allusions abound in all his work (probably more so than in the writing of any other avowed atheist in modern literature), and Christian themes – judgment, forgiveness, despair, sacrifice, passion, etc. – permeate the novels. (Mersault and Clamence, it is worth noting, are presented not just as sinners, devils, and outcasts, but in several instances explicitly, and not entirely ironically, as Christ figures.)

Meanwhile alongside and against this leitmotif of Christian images and themes, Camus sets the main components of his essentially pagan world view. Like Nietzsche, he maintains a special admiration for Greek heroic values and pessimism and for classical virtues like courage and honor. What might be termed Romantic values also merit particular esteem within his philosophy: passion, absorption in being, sensory experience, the glory of the moment, the beauty of the world.

As a result of this duality of influence, Camus’ basic philosophical problem becomes how to reconcile his Augustinian sense of original sin (universal guilt) and rampant moral evil with his personal ideal of pagan primitivism (universal innocence) and his conviction that the natural world and our life in it have intrinsic beauty and value. Can an absurd world have intrinsic value? Is authentic pessimism compatible with the view that there is an essential dignity to human life? Such questions raise the possibility that there may be deep logical inconsistencies within Camus’ philosophy, and some critics (notably Sartre) have suggested that these inconsistencies cannot be surmounted except through some sort of Kierkegaardian leap of faith on Camus’ part – in this case a leap leading to a belief not in God, but in man.

Such a leap is certainly implied in an oft-quoted remark from Camus’ “Letter to a German Friend,” where he wrote: “I continue to believe that this world has no supernatural meaning . . . But I know that something in the world has meaning – man.” One can find similar affirmations and protestations on behalf of humanity throughout Camus’ writings. They are almost a hallmark of his philosophical style. Oracular and high-flown, they clearly have more rhetorical force than logical potency. On the other hand, if we are trying to locate Camus’ place in European philosophical tradition, they provide a strong clue as to where he properly belongs. Surprisingly, the sentiment here, a commonplace of the Enlightenment and of traditional liberalism, is much closer in spirit to the exuberant secular humanism of the Italian Renaissance than to the agnostic skepticism of contemporary post-modernism.

vi. Individual vs. History and Mass Culture

A primary theme of early twentieth-century European literature and critical thought is the rise of modern mass civilization and its suffocating effects of alienation and dehumanization. By the time Camus was establishing his literary reputation, this theme had become pervasive. Anxiety over the fate of Western culture, already intense, escalated to apocalyptic levels with the sudden emergence of fascism, totalitarianism, and new technologies of coercion and death. Here then was a subject ready-made for a writer of Camus’ political and humanistic views. He responded to the occasion with typical force and eloquence.

In one way or another, the themes of alienation and dehumanization as by-products of an increasingly technical and automated world enter into nearly all of Camus’ works. Even his concept of the Absurd becomes multiplied by a social and economic world in which meaningless routines and mind-numbing repetitions predominate. The drudgery of Sisyphus is mirrored and amplified in the assembly line, the business office, the government bureau, and especially in the penal colony and concentration camp.

In line with this theme, the ever-ambiguous Merseault in The Stranger can be understood as both a depressing manifestation of the newly emerging mass personality (that is, as a figure devoid of basic human feelings and passions) and, conversely, as a lone hold-out, a last remaining specimen of the old Romanticism – and hence a figure who is viewed as both dangerous and alien by the robotic majority. Similarly, The Plague can be interpreted, on at least one level, as an allegory in which humanity must be preserved from the fatal pestilence of mass culture, which converts formerly free, autonomous, independent-minded, human beings into a soulless new species.

In his reflections on this theme, Camus differs from most other European writers (and especially from those on the Left) in viewing mass reform and revolutionary movements, notably Marxism, as representing at least as great a threat to individual freedom as industrial capitalism. Throughout his career he continued to cherish and defend old-fashioned virtues like personal courage and honor that other Left-wing intellectuals tended to view as reactionary or bourgeois.

vii. Suicide

Suicide is the central subject of The Myth of Sisyphus and serves as a background theme in Caligula and The Fall. (In Caligula the mad title character, in a fit of horror and revulsion at the meaninglessness of life, would rather die – and bring the world down with him – than accept a cosmos that is indifferent to human fate or that will not submit to his individual will. In The Fall, a stranger’s act of suicide serves as the starting point for a bitter ritual of self-scrutiny and remorse on the part of the narrator).

Like Wittgenstein (who had a family history of suicide and suffered from bouts of depression), Camus considered suicide the fundamental issue for moral philosophy. However, unlike other philosophers who have written on the subject (from Cicero and Seneca to Montaigne and Schopenhauer), Camus seems uninterested in assessing the traditional motives and justifications for suicide (for instance, to avoid a long, painful, and debilitating illness or as a response to personal tragedy or scandal). Indeed he seems interested in the problem only to the extent that it represents one possible response to the Absurd. His verdict on the matter is unqualified and clear: the only courageous and morally valid response to the Absurd is to continue living. “Suicide is not an option.”

viii. The Death Penalty

From the time he first heard the story of his father’s literal nausea and revulsion after witnessing a public execution, Camus began a vocal and lifelong opposition to the death penalty. Executions by guillotine were a common public spectacle in Algeria during his lifetime, but he refused to attend them and recoiled bitterly at their very mention.

Condemnation of capital punishment is both explicit and implicit in his writings. For example, in The Stranger Merseault’s long confinement during his trial and his eventual execution are presented as part of an elaborate, ceremonial ritual involving both public and religious authorities. The grim rationality of this process of legalized murder contrasts markedly with the sudden, irrational, almost accidental nature of his actual crime. Similarly, in the Myth of Sisyphus, the would-be suicide is contrasted with his fatal opposite, the man condemned to death, and we are continually reminded that a sentence of death is our common fate in an absurd universe.

Camus’ opposition to the death penalty is not specifically philosophical. That is, it is not based on a particular moral theory or principle (such as Cesare Beccaria’s utilitarian objection that capital punishment is wrong because it has not been proven to have a deterrent effect greater than life imprisonment). Camus’ opposition, in contrast, is humanitarian, conscientious, almost visceral. Like Victor Hugo, his great predecessor on this issue, he views the death penalty as an egregious barbarism – an act of blood riot and vengeance covered over with a thin veneer of law and civility to make it acceptable to modern sensibilities. That it is also an act of vengeance aimed primarily at the poor and oppressed, and that it is given religious sanction, makes it even more hideous and indefensible in his view.

Camus’ essay “Reflections on the Guillotine” supplies a detailed examination of the issue. An eloquent personal statement, with compelling psychological and philosophical insights, it includes the author’s direct rebuttal to traditional retributionist arguments in favor of capital punishment (such as Kant’s claim that death is the legally appropriate, indeed morally required, penalty for murder). To all who argue that murder must be punished in kind, Camus replies:

Capital punishment is the most premeditated of murders, to which no criminal’s deed, however calculated, can be compared. For there to be an equivalency, the death penalty would have to punish a criminal who had warned his victim of the date on which he would inflict a horrible death on him and who, from that moment onward, had confined him at his mercy for months. Such a monster is not to be encountered in private life.

Camus concludes his essay by arguing that, at the very least, France should abolish the savage spectacle of the guillotine and replace it with a more humane procedure (such as lethal injection). But he still retains a scant hope that capital punishment will be completely abolished at some point in the time to come: “In the unified Europe of the future the solemn abolition of the death penalty ought to be the first article of the European Code we all hope for.” Camus himself did not live to see the day, but he would no doubt be gratified to know that abolition of capital punishment is now an essential prerequisite for membership in the European Union.

6. Existentialism

Camus is often classified as an existentialist writer, and it is easy to see why. Affinities with Kierkegaard and Sartre are patent. He shares with these philosophers (and with the other major writers in the existentialist tradition, from Augustine and Pascal to Dostoyevsky and Nietzsche) an habitual and intense interest in the active human psyche, in the life of conscience or spirit as it is actually experienced and lived. Like these writers, he aims at nothing less than a thorough, candid exegesis of the human condition, and like them he exhibits not just a philosophical attraction but also a personal commitment to such values as individualism, free choice, inner strength, authenticity, personal responsibility, and self-determination.

However, one troublesome fact remains: throughout his career Camus repeatedly denied that he was an existentialist. Was this an accurate and honest self-assessment? On the one hand, some critics have questioned this “denial” (using the term almost in its modern clinical sense), attributing it to the celebrated Sartre-Camus political “feud” or to a certain stubbornness or even contrariness on Camus’ part. In their view, Camus qualifies as, at minimum, a closet existentialist, and in certain respects (e.g., in his unconditional and passionate concern for the individual) as an even truer specimen of the type than Sartre himself.

On the other hand, besides his personal rejection of the label, there appear to be solid reasons for challenging the claim that Camus is an existentialist. For one thing, it is noteworthy that he never showed much interest in (indeed he largely avoided) metaphysical and ontological questions (the philosophical raison d’etre and bread and butter of Heidegger and Sartre). Of course there is no rule that says an existentialist must be a metaphysician. However, Camus’ seeming aversion to technical philosophical discussion does suggest one way in which he distanced himself from contemporary existentialist thought.

Another point of divergence is that Camus seems to have regarded existentialism as a complete and systematic world-view, that is, a fully articulated doctrine. In his view, to be a true existentialist one had to commit to the entire doctrine (and not merely to bits and pieces of it), and this was apparently something he was unwilling to do.

Yet a further point of separation, and possibly a decisive one, is that Camus actively challenged and set himself apart from the existentialist motto that being precedes essence. Ultimately, against Sartre in particular and existentialists in general, he clings to his instinctive belief in a common human nature. In his view human existence necessarily includes an essential core element of dignity and value, and in this respect he seems surprisingly closer to the humanist tradition from Aristotle to Kant than to the modern tradition of skepticism and relativism from Nietzsche to Derrida (the latter his fellow-countryman and, at least in his commitment to human rights and opposition to the death penalty, his spiritual successor and descendant).

7. Significance and Legacy

Obviously, Camus’ writings remain the primary reason for his continuing importance and the chief source of his cultural legacy. But his fame is also due (and that in no small part and to a degree unusual among writers and intellectuals) to his exemplary life. He truly lived his philosophy. And thus it is in his personal political stands and public statements as well as in his books that we can find his views clearly articulated. In short, he bequeathed not just his words but also his actions. Taken together, those words and actions embody a core set of liberal democratic values – including tolerance, justice, liberty, open-mindedness, respect for personhood, condemnation of violence, and resistance to tyranny – that can be fully approved and acted upon by the modern intellectual engagé.

On a purely literary level, one of Camus’ most original contributions to modern discourse is his distinctive prose style. Terse and hard-boiled, yet at the same time lyrical, and indeed capable of great, soaring flights of emotion and feeling, Camus’ style represents a deliberate attempt on his part to wed the famous clarity, elegance, and dry precision of the French philosophical tradition with the more sonorous and opulent manner of 19th century Romantic fiction. The result is something like a cross between Hemingway (a Camus favorite) and Melville (another favorite); or between Diderot and Hugo. For the most part when we read Camus we encounter the plain syntax, simple vocabulary, and biting aphorism typical of modern theatre or noir detective fiction. However, this base style frequently becomes a counterpoint or springboard for extended musings and lavish descriptions almost in the manner of Proust. And here we may note that this attempted reconciliation or union of opposing styles is not just an aesthetic gesture on the author’s part. It is also a moral and political statement as well. It says, in effect, that the life of reason and the life of feeling need not be opposed; that intellect and passion can, and should, operate together.

Perhaps the greatest inspiration and example that Camus provides for contemporary readers is the lesson that it is still possible for a serious thinker to face the modern world (with a full understanding of its contradictions, injustices, brutal flaws, and absurdities) with hardly a grain of hope, yet utterly without cynicism. To read Camus is to find words like justice, freedom, humanity, and dignity used plainly and openly, without apology or embarrassment, and without the pained or derisive facial expressions or invisible quotation marks that almost automatically accompany those terms in public discourse today.

At Stockholm Camus concluded his Nobel acceptance speech with a stirring reminder and challenge to modern writers. “The nobility of our craft,” he declared, “will always be rooted in two commitments, both difficult to maintain: the refusal to lie about what one knows and the resistance to oppression.” He left behind a body of work faithful to his own credo that the arts of language must always be used in the service of truth and the service of liberty.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Barthes, Roland. Writing Degree Zero. New York: Hill and Wang, 1968.
  • Bloom, Harold, ed. Albert Camus. New York: Chelsea House, 1989.
  • Brée, Germaine. Camus. New Brunswick, NJ: Rutgers University Press, 1961.
  • Brée, Germaine, ed. Camus: A Collection of Critical Essays. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall, 1962.
  • Cruickshank, John. Albert Camus and the Literature of Revolt. London: Oxford University Press, 1959.
  • Cruickshank, John. The Novelist as Philosopher. London: Oxford University Press, 1959.
  • Kauffman, Walter, ed. Religion from Tolstoy to Camus. New York: Harper, 1964.
  • Lottman, Herbert R. Albert Camus: A Biography. Corte Madera, CA: Gingko Press, 1997.
  • Malraux, Andre. Anti-Memoirs. New York: Holt, Rinehart, and Winston, 1968.
  • Thrody, Philip. Albert Camus, 1913-1960. London: Hamish Hamilton, 1961.
  • Sartre, Jean-Paul. “Camus’ The Outsider.” In Situations. New York: George Braziller, 1965.
  • Todd, Olivier. Albert Camus : A Life. New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 1997.

Author Information

David Simpson
DePaul University
U. S. A.


"Symposium" is the Greek term for a drinking-party. The symposium must be distinguished from the deipnon; for though drinking almost always followed a dinner-party, yet the former was regarded as entirely distinct from the latter, was regulated by different customs, and frequently received the addition of many guests who were not present at the dinner. For the Greeks did not usually drink at their dinner, and it was not until the conclusion of the meal that wine was introduced. Symposia were very frequent at Athens. Their enjoyment was heightened by agreeable conversation, by the introduction of music and dancing, and by games and amusements of various kinds; sometimes, too, philosophical subjects were discussed at them. The Symposia of Plato and Xenophon give us a lively idea of such entertainments at Athens. The name itself shows that the enjoyment of drinking was the main object of the symposia: wine from the juice of the grape (oinos ampelinos) was the only drink partaken of by the Greeks, with the exception of water. The wine was almost invariably mixed with water, and to drink it unmixed (akraton) was considered a characteristic of barbarians. The mixture was made in a large vessel called the crater, from which it was conveyed into the drinking-cups. The guests at a symposium reclined on couches, and were crowned with garlands of flowers.

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"Synderesis" is a technical term from scholastic philosophy, signifying the innate principle in the moral consciousness of every person which directs the agent to good and restrains him from evil. It is first found in a singe passage of St. Jerome (d. 420) in his explanation of the four living creatures in Ezekiel's vision. Jerome explains that most commentators hold that the human, the lion, and the ox of the vision represent the rational, the irascible, and the appetitive (or concupiscent) parts of the soul, according to Plato's division, while the fourth figure, that of the eagle, represents a fourth part of the soul, above and outside these three:

This the Greeks call synderesis, which spark of conscience was not extinguished from the breast of Adam when he was driven from Paradise. Through it, when overcome by pleasures or by anger, or even as sometimes deceived by a similitude of reason, we feel that we sin; ... and this in the scriptures is sometimes called spirit.... And yet we perceive that the conscience (conscientia) is itself also thrown aside and driven from its place by some who have no shame or modesty in their faults.

In this passage no distinction seems to be drawn between synderesis and conscientia. It has even been maintained that the former word is a copyist's error for synderesis, the usual Greek equivalent for "conscientia".

The use of synderesis as distinct from conscientia among the scholastics, and to a slight extent among early Protestant moralists, is founded on its description by Jerome as scintilla conscientiae - the spark - from which the light of conscience arises. Thus Jeremy Taylor calls it "the spark or fire put into the heart of humans," while synderesis, which is specifically called conscience of the deed done, is the "bringing fuel to this fire (Ductor Dubitantium 1:1:1) As distinguished from synderesis, conscientia is applied by these writers to the particular attitude of a person to good or evil action, and may accordingly be an unsafe guide. Synderesis is thus a faculty or habit (it was disputed which) both of judging and of willing the right, in agreeement with "original righteousness" and persisting in the separate powers of the soul in spite of the corruption of human nature brought about by the Fall. In the earlier descriptions it is spoken of as volitional as well as intellectual. According to Aquinas, however, it is distinctly practical reason - certain principles belonging to the practical side of reason which point out the right direction for action, just as the theoretical axioms of the understanding do for thinking. Both synderesis and conscientia are placed among the intellectual powers. A different view is given by Bonaventura, who makes the whole distinction between conscientia and synderesis rest upon the distinction between judgment and will. God (he says) has implanted a double rule of right in human nature: one for judging rightly, and this is the moral strength of conscience; another for right volition, and this is the moral strength of synderesis, whose function is to dissuade from evil and stimulate to good, and which may therefore be described as the original moral tendency of the disposition.

This, however, does not seem to be either the best or the most prevalent view of scholasticism regarding synderesis. The question is fully discussed by Duns Scotus, who decided against Bonaventura that both synderesis and conscience belong to practial reason, the former giving the first principles or major premises of its practical syllogisms, the latter corresponding to their conclusions (In Sent. Reportationes Bk 2:39, Q1-2). Jeremy Taylor also follows the Thomistic use and makes synderesis "the general repository of moral principles or measures." This is the "rule of conscience," while conscience itself is "a conjunction of the universal practical law with the particular moral action." It applies the rule to the particular case, and is thus both witness and judge of moral actions. It may be noted that the term "conscience," when used (as by Kant) as equivalent to practical reason regarded as infallible, corresponds to the medieval synderesis, and not to the medieval conscientia.

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Stoic Ethics

The tremendous influence Stoicism has exerted on ethical thought from early Christianity through Immanuel Kant and into the twentieth century is rarely understood and even more rarely appreciated. Throughout history, Stoic ethical doctrines have both provoked harsh criticisms and inspired enthusiastic defenders. The Stoics defined the goal in life as living in agreement with nature. Humans, unlike all other animals, are constituted by nature to develop reason as adults, which transforms their understanding of themselves and their own true good. The Stoics held that virtue is the only real good and so is both necessary and, contrary to Aristotle, sufficient for happiness; it in no way depends on luck. The virtuous life is free of all passions, which are intrinsically disturbing and harmful to the soul, but includes appropriate emotive responses conditioned by rational understanding and the fulfillment of all one's personal, social, professional, and civic responsibilities. The Stoics believed that the person who has achieved perfect consistency in the operation of his rational faculties, the "wise man," is extremely rare, yet serves as a prescriptive ideal for all. The Stoics believed that progress toward this noble goal is both possible and vitally urgent.

Table of Contents

  1. Definition of the End
  2. Theory of Appropriation
  3. Good, Evil, and Indifferents
  4. Appropriate Acts and Perfect Acts
  5. Passions
  6. Moral Progress
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Definition of the End

Stoicism is known as a eudaimonistic theory, which means that the culmination of human endeavor or ‘end' (telos) is eudaimonia, meaning very roughly "happiness" or “flourishing.” The Stoics defined this end as “living in agreement with nature.” “Nature” is a complex and multivalent concept for the Stoics, and so their definition of the goal or final end of human striving is very rich.

The first sense of the definition is living in accordance with nature as a whole, i.e. the entire cosmos. Cosmic nature (the universe), the Stoics firmly believed, is a rationally organized and well-ordered system, and indeed coextensive with the will of Zeus, the impersonal god. Consequently, all events that occur within the universe fit within a coherent, well-structured scheme that is providential. Since there is no room for chance within this rationally ordered system, the Stoics' metaphysical determinism further dictated that this cosmic Nature is identical to fate. Thus at this level, "living in agreement with nature" means conforming one’s will with the sequence of events that are fated to occur in the rationally constituted universe, as providentially willed by Zeus.

Each type of thing within the universe has its own specific constitution and character. This second sense of ‘nature' is what we use when we say it is the nature of fire to move upward. The manner in which living things come to be, change, and perish distinguishes them from the manner in which non-living things come to be, change, and cease to be. Thus the nature of plants is quite distinct from the nature of rocks and sand. To "live in agreement with nature" in this second sense would thus include, for example, metabolic functions: taking in nutrition, growth, reproduction, and expelling waste. A plant that is successful at performing these functions is a healthy, flourishing specimen.

In addition to basic metabolism, animals have the capacities of sense-perception, desire, and locomotion. Moreover, animals have an innate impulse to care for their offspring. Thus living in agreement with a creature's animality involves more complex behaviors than those of a plant living in agreement with its nature. For an animal parent to neglect its own offspring would therefore be for it to behave contrary to its nature. The Stoics believed that compared to other animals, human beings are neither the strongest, nor the fastest, nor the best swimmers, nor able to fly. Instead, the distinct and uniquely human capacity is reason. Thus for human beings, "living in agreement with nature" means living in agreement with our special, innate endowment—the ability to reason.

2. Theory of Appropriation

The Stoics developed a sophisticated psychological theory to explain how the advent of reason fundamentally transforms the world view of human beings as they mature. This is the theory of ‘appropriation,' or oikeiôsis, a technical term which scholars have also translated variously as "orientation," “familiarization,” “affinity,” or “affiliation.” The word means the recognition of something as one’s own, as belonging to oneself. The opposite of oikeiôsis is allotriôsis, which neatly translates as “alienation.” According to the Stoic theory of appropriation, there are two different developmental stages. In the first stage, the innate, initial impulse of a living organism, plant, or animal is self-love and not pleasure, as the rival Epicureans contend. The organism is aware of its own constitution, though for plants this awareness is more primitive than it is for animals. This awareness involves the immediate recognition of its own body as “belonging to” itself. The creature is thus directed toward maintaining its constitution in its proper, i.e. its natural, condition. As a consequence, the organism is impelled to preserve itself by pursuing things that promote its own well-being and by avoiding things harmful to it. Pleasure is only a by-product of success in this activity. In the case of a human infant, for example, appropriation explains why the baby seeks his mother’s milk. But as the child matures, his constitution evolves. The child continues to love himself, but as he matures into adolescence his capacity for reason emerges and what he recognizes as his constitution, or self, is crucially transformed. Where he previously identified his constitution as his body, he begins to identify his constitution instead with his mental faculty (reason) in a certain relation to his body. In short, the self that he now loves is his rationality. Our human reason gives us an affinity with the cosmic reason, Nature, that guides the universe. The fully matured adult thus comes to identify his real self, his true good, with his completely developed, perfected rational soul. This best possible state of the rational soul is exactly what virtue is.

Whereas the first stage of the theory of appropriation gives an account of our relationship toward ourselves, the second stage explains our social relationship toward others. The Stoics observed that a parent is naturally impelled to love her own children and have concern for their welfare. Parental love is motivated by the child's intimate affinity and likeness to her. But since we possess reason in common with all (or nearly all) human beings, we identify ourselves not only with our own immediate family, but with all members of the human race—they are all fellow members of our broader rational community. In this way the Stoics meant social appropriation to constitute an explanation of the natural genesis of altruism.

3. Good, Evil, and Indifferents

The Stoics defined the good as "what is complete according to nature for a rational being qua rational being" (Cicero Fin. III.33). As explained above, the perfected nature of a rational being is precisely the perfection of reason, and the perfection of reason is virtue. The Stoics maintained, quite controversially among ancient ethical thought, that the only thing that always contributes to happiness, as its necessary and sufficient condition, is virtue. Conversely, the only thing that necessitates misery and is “bad” or “evil” is the corruption of reason, namely vice. All other things were judged neither good nor evil, but instead fell into the class of “indifferents.” They were called “indifferents” because the Stoics held that these things in themselves neither contribute to nor detract from a happy life. Indifferents neither benefit nor harm since they can be used well and badly.

However, within the class of indifferents the Stoics distinguished the "preferred" from the “dispreferred.” (A third subclass contains the ‘absolute' indifferents, e.g. whether the number of hairs on one’s head is odd or even, whether to bend or extend one’s finger.) Preferred indifferents are “according to nature.” Dispreferred indifferents are “contrary to nature.” This is because possession or use of the preferred indifferents usually promotes the natural condition of a person, and so selecting them is usually commended by reason. The preferred indifferents include life, health, pleasure, beauty, strength, wealth, good reputation, and noble birth. The dispreferred indifferents include death, disease, pain, ugliness, weakness, poverty, low repute, and ignoble birth. While it is usually appropriate to avoid the dispreferred indifferents, in unusual circumstances it may be virtuous to select them rather than avoid them. The virtue or vice of the agent is thus determined not by the possession of an indifferent, but rather by how it is used or selected. It is the virtuous use of indifferents that makes a life happy, the vicious use that makes it unhappy.

The Stoics elaborated a detailed taxonomy of virtue, dividing virtue into four main types: wisdom, justice, courage, and moderation. Wisdom is subdivided into good sense, good calculation, quick-wittedness, discretion, and resourcefulness. Justice is subdivided into piety, honesty, equity, and fair dealing. Courage is subdivided into endurance, confidence, high-mindedness, cheerfulness, and industriousness. Moderation is subdivided into good discipline, seemliness, modesty, and self-control. Similarly, the Stoics divide vice into foolishness, injustice, cowardice, intemperance, and the rest. The Stoics further maintained that the virtues are inter-entailing and constitute a unity: to have one is to have them all. They held that the same virtuous mind is wise, just, courageous, and moderate. Thus, the virtuous person is disposed in a certain way with respect to each of the individual virtues. To support their doctrine of the unity of virtue, the Stoics offered an analogy: just as someone is both a poet and an orator and a general but is still one individual, so too the virtues are unified but apply to different spheres of action.

4. Appropriate Acts and Perfect Acts

Once a human being has developed reason, his function is to perform "appropriate acts" or “proper functions.” The Stoics defined an appropriate act as “that which reason persuades one to do” or “that which when done admits of reasonable justification.” Maintaining one's health is given as an example. Since health is neither good nor bad in itself, but rather is capable of being used well or badly, opting to maintain one’s health by, say, walking, must harmonize with all other actions the agent performs. Similarly, sacrificing one’s property is an example of an act that is only appropriate under certain circumstances. The performance of appropriate acts is only a necessary and not a sufficient condition of virtuous action. This is because the agent must have the correct understanding of the actions he performs. Specifically, his selections and rejections must form a continuous series of actions that is consistent with all of the virtues simultaneously. Each and every deed represents the totality and harmony of his moral integrity. The vast majority of people are non-virtuous because though they may follow reason correctly in honoring their parents, for example, they fail to conform to ‘the laws of life as a whole’ by acting appropriately with respect to all of the other virtues.

The scale of actions from vicious to virtuous can be laid out as follows: (1) Actions done "against the appropriate act," which include neglecting one's parents, not treating friends kindly, not behaving patriotically, and squandering one’s wealth in the wrong circumstances; (2) Intermediate appropriate actions in which the agent’s disposition is not suitably consistent, and so would not count as virtuous, although the action itself approximates proper conduct. Examples include honoring one’s parents, siblings, and country, socializing with friends, and sacrificing one’s wealth in the right circumstances; (3) “Perfect acts” performed in the right way by the agent with an absolutely rational, consistent, and formally perfect disposition. This perfect disposition is virtue.

5. Passions

As we have seen, only virtue is good and choiceworthy, and only its opposite, vice, is bad and to be avoided according to Stoic ethics. The vast majority of people fail to understand this. Ordinary people habitually and wrongly judge various objects and events to be good and bad that are in fact indifferent. The disposition to make a judgment disobedient to reason is the psychic disturbance the Stoics called passion (pathos). Since passion is an impulse (a movement of the soul) which is excessive and contrary to reason, it is irrational and contrary to nature. The four general types of passion are distress, fear, appetite, and pleasure. Distress and pleasure pertain to present objects, fear and appetite to future objects. The following table illustrates their relations.

Table of Four Passions (pathê)

Present Object
Future Object
Irrationally judged to be good
Irrationally judged to be bad

Distress is an irrational contraction of the soul variously described as malice, envy, jealousy, pity, grief, worry, sorrow, annoyance, vexation, or anguish. Fear, an irrational shrinking of the soul, is expectation of something bad; hesitation, agony, shock, shame, panic, superstition, dread, and terror are classified under it. Appetite is an irrational stretching or swelling of the soul reaching for an expected good; it is also called want, yearning, hatred, quarrelsomeness, anger, wrath, intense sexual craving, or spiritedness. Pleasure is an irrational elation over what seems to be worth choosing; it includes rejoicing at another's misfortunes, enchantment, self-gratification, and rapture.

The soul of the virtuous person, in contrast, is possessed of three good states or affective responses (eupatheiai). The three ‘good states' of the soul are joy (chara), caution (eulabeia), and wish (boulêsis). Joy, the opposite of pleasure, is a reasonable elation; enjoyment, good spirits, and tranquility are classed under it. Caution, the opposite of fear, is a reasonable avoidance. Respect and sanctity are subtypes of caution. Wish, the opposite of appetite, is a reasonable striving also described as good will, kindliness, acceptance, or contentment. There is no "good feeling" counterpart to the passion of distress.

Table of Three Good States

Present Object
Future Object
Rationally judged to be good
Rationally judged to be bad

For example, the virtuous person experiences joy in the company of a friend, but recognizes that the presence of the friend is not itself a real good as virtue is, but only preferred. That is to say the company of the friend is to be sought so long as doing so in no way involves any vicious acts like a dereliction of his responsibilities to others. The friend's absence does not hurt the soul of the virtuous person, only vice does. The vicious person’s soul, in contrast, is gripped by the passion of pleasure in the presence of, say, riches. When the wealth is lost, this irrational judgment will be replaced by the corresponding irrational judgment that poverty is really bad, thus making the vicious person miserable. Consequently, the virtuous person wishes to see his friend only if in the course of events it is good to happen. His wish is thus made with reservation (hupexhairesis): "I wish to see my friend if it is fated, if Zeus wills it." If the event does not occur, then the virtuous person is not thwarted, and as a result he is not disappointed or unhappy. His wish is rational and in agreement with nature, both in the sense of being obedient to reason (which is distinctive of our human constitution) and in the sense of harmonizing with the series of events in the world.

The virtuous person is not passionless in the sense of being unfeeling like a statue. Rather, he mindfully distinguishes what makes a difference to his happiness—virtue and vice—from what does not. This firm and consistent understanding keeps the ups and downs of his life from spinning into the psychic disturbances or "pathologies" the Stoics understood passions to be.

6. Moral Progress

The early Stoics were fond of uncompromising dichotomies—all who are not wise are fools, all who are not free are slaves, all who are not virtuous are vicious, etc. The later Stoics distinguished within the class of fools between those making progress and those who are not. Although the wise man or sage was said to be rarer than the phoenix, it is useful to see the concept of the wise man functioning as a prescriptive ideal at which all can aim. This ideal is thus not an impossibly high target, its pursuit sheer futility. Rather, all who are not wise have the rational resources to persevere in their journey toward this ideal. Stoic teachers could employ this exalted image as a pedagogical device to exhort their students to exert constant effort to improve themselves and not lapse into complacency. The Stoics were convinced that as one approached this goal, one came closer to real and certain happiness.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Becker, Lawrence C. 1998. A New Stoicism. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • A daring exposition of what Stoic philosophy would look like today if it had enjoyed a continuous development through the Renaissance, the Enlightenment, modern science, and the fads of twentieth century moral philosophy.
  • Brennan, Tad. 2003. "Stoic Moral Psychology," in Brad Inwood, ed., The Cambridge Companion to the Stoics, 257-294.
  • Cooper, John. 1989. "Greek Philosophers on Euthanasia and Suicide," in Brody, B.A. ed., Suicide and Euthanasia. Dordrecht, 9-38.
  • Inwood, Brad and Donini, Pierluigi. 1999. "Stoic ethics," in Algra, Keimpe, et al. eds. The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 675-738.
    • A detailed treatment of the subject.
  • Long, A. A. 1986. Hellenistic Philosophy: Stoics, Epicureans, Sceptics. 2nd ed. Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press.
    • A very readable introduction to the three Hellenistic schools.
  • Long, A. A. and D. N. Sedley. 1987. The Hellenistic Philosophers, Volume 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Readings from the main schools: Epicureanism, Stoicism, Scepticism, and the Academics. Includes commentaries on the readings. This is the standard primary source text.
  • Schofield, Malcolm. "Stoic Ethics," in Brad Inwood, ed., The Cambridge Companion to the Stoics, 233-256.
    • A fine overview that argues that Zeno (founder of the Stoa) systematized the Socratic and Cynic philosophies. Two different types of projects in Stoic ethics are identified: (1) laying out the definitions and divisions of the key concepts in discursive ethical discourse, and (2) trying to explain and establish by argument the Stoic view on key ethical subjects.
  • Sorabji, Richard. 2000. Emotion and Peace of Mind: From Stoic Agitation to Christian Temptation. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • A meticulous study of Stoic moral psychology and much more.

Author Information

William O. Stephens
Creighton University
U. S. A.

Social Contract Theory

Social contract theory, nearly as old as philosophy itself, is the view that persons' moral and/or political obligations are dependent upon a contract or agreement among them to form the society in which they live. Socrates uses something quite like a social contract argument to explain to Crito why he must remain in prison and accept the death penalty. However, social contract theory is rightly associated with modern moral and political theory and is given its first full exposition and defense by Thomas Hobbes. After Hobbes, John Locke and Jean-Jacques Rousseau are the best known proponents of this enormously influential theory, which has been one of the most dominant theories within moral and political theory throughout the history of the modern West. In the twentieth century, moral and political theory regained philosophical momentum as a result of John Rawls’ Kantian version of social contract theory, and was followed by new analyses of the subject by David Gauthier and others. More recently, philosophers from different perspectives have offered new criticisms of social contract theory. In particular, feminists and race-conscious philosophers have argued that social contract theory is at least an incomplete picture of our moral and political lives, and may in fact camouflage some of the ways in which the contract is itself parasitical upon the subjugations of classes of persons.

Table of Contents

  1. Socrates' Argument
  2. Modern Social Contract Theory
    1. Thomas Hobbes
    2. John Locke
    3. Jean-Jacques Rousseau
  3. More Recent Social Contract Theories
    1. John Rawls' A Theory of Justice
    2. David Gauthier
  4. Contemporary Critiques of Social Contract Theory
    1. Feminist Arguments
      1. The Sexual Contract
      2. The Nature of the Liberal Individual
      3. Arguing from Care
    2. Race-Conscious Argument
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Socrates' Argument

In the early Platonic dialogue, Crito, Socrates makes a compelling argument as to why he must stay in prison and accept the death penalty, rather than escape and go into exile in another Greek city. He personifies the Laws of Athens, and, speaking in their voice, explains that he has acquired an overwhelming obligation to obey the Laws because they have made his entire way of life, and even the fact of his very existence, possible. They made it possible for his mother and father to marry, and therefore to have legitimate children, including himself. Having been born, the city of Athens, through its laws, then required that his father care for and educate him. Socrates' life and the way in which that life has flourished in Athens are each dependent upon the Laws. Importantly, however, this relationship between citizens and the Laws of the city are not coerced. Citizens, once they have grown up, and have seen how the city conducts itself, can choose whether to leave, taking their property with them, or stay. Staying implies an agreement to abide by the Laws and accept the punishments that they mete out. And, having made an agreement that is itself just, Socrates asserts that he must keep to this agreement that he has made and obey the Laws, in this case, by staying and accepting the death penalty. Importantly, the contract described by Socrates is an implicit one: it is implied by his choice to stay in Athens, even though he is free to leave.

In Plato's most well-known dialogue, Republic, social contract theory is represented again, although this time less favorably. In Book II, Glaucon offers a candidate for an answer to the question "what is justice?" by representing a social contract explanation for the nature of justice. What men would most want is to be able to commit injustices against others without the fear of reprisal, and what they most want to avoid is being treated unjustly by others without being able to do injustice in return. Justice then, he says, is the conventional result of the laws and covenants that men make in order to avoid these extremes. Being unable to commit injustice with impunity (as those who wear the ring of Gyges would), and fearing becoming victims themselves, men decide that it is in their interests to submit themselves to the convention of justice. Socrates rejects this view, and most of the rest of the dialogue centers on showing that justice is worth having for its own sake, and that the just man is the happy man. So, from Socrates’ point of view, justice has a value that greatly exceeds the prudential value that Glaucon assigns to it.

These views, in the Crito and the Republic, might seem at first glance inconsistent: in the former dialogue Socrates uses a social contract type of argument to show why it is just for him to remain in prison, whereas in the latter he rejects social contract as the source of justice. These two views are, however, reconcilable. From Socrates' point of view, a just man is one who will, among other things, recognize his obligation to the state by obeying its laws. The state is the morally and politically most fundamental entity, and as such deserves our highest allegiance and deepest respect. Just men know this and act accordingly. Justice, however, is more than simply obeying laws in exchange for others obeying them as well. Justice is the state of a well-regulated soul, and so the just man will also necessarily be the happy man. So, justice is more than the simple reciprocal obedience to law, as Glaucon suggests, but it does nonetheless include obedience to the state and the laws that sustain it. So in the end, although Plato is perhaps the first philosopher to offer a representation of the argument at the heart of social contract theory, Socrates ultimately rejects the idea that social contract is the original source of justice.

2. Modern Social Contract Theory

a. Thomas Hobbes

Thomas Hobbes, 1588-1679, lived during the most crucial period of early modern England's history: the English Civil War, waged from 1642-1648. To describe this conflict in the most general of terms, it was a clash between the King and his supporters, the Monarchists, who preferred the traditional authority of a monarch, and the Parliamentarians, most notably led by Oliver Cromwell, who demanded more power for the quasi-democratic institution of Parliament. Hobbes represents a compromise between these two factions. On the one hand he rejects the theory of the Divine Right of Kings, which is most eloquently expressed by Robert Filmer in his Patriarcha or the Natural Power of Kings, (although it would be left to John Locke to refute Filmer directly). Filmer’s view held that a king’s authority was invested in him (or, presumably, her) by God, that such authority was absolute, and therefore that the basis of political obligation lay in our obligation to obey God absolutely. According to this view, then, political obligation is subsumed under religious obligation. On the other hand, Hobbes also rejects the early democratic view, taken up by the Parliamentarians, that power ought to be shared between Parliament and the King. In rejecting both these views, Hobbes occupies the ground of one is who both radical and conservative. He argues, radically for his times, that political authority and obligation are based on the individual self-interests of members of society who are understood to be equal to one another, with no single individual invested with any essential authority to rule over the rest, while at the same time maintaining the conservative position that the monarch, which he called the Sovereign, must be ceded absolute authority if society is to survive.

Hobbes' political theory is best understood if taken in two parts: his theory of human motivation, Psychological Egoism, and his theory of the social contract, founded on the hypothetical State of Nature. Hobbes has, first and foremost, a particular theory of human nature, which gives rise to a particular view of morality and politics, as developed in his philosophical masterpiece, Leviathan, published in 1651. The Scientific Revolution, with its important new discoveries that the universe could be both described and predicted in accordance with universal laws of nature, greatly influenced Hobbes. He sought to provide a theory of human nature that would parallel the discoveries being made in the sciences of the inanimate universe. His psychological theory is therefore informed by mechanism, the general view that everything in the universe is produced by nothing other than matter in motion. According to Hobbes, this extends to human behavior. Human macro-behavior can be aptly described as the effect of certain kinds of micro-behavior, even though some of this latter behavior is invisible to us. So, such behaviors as walking, talking, and the like are themselves produced by other actions inside of us. And these other actions are themselves caused by the interaction of our bodies with other bodies, human or otherwise, which create in us certain chains of causes and effects, and which eventually give rise to the human behavior that we can plainly observe. We, including all of our actions and choices, are then, according to this view, as explainable in terms of universal laws of nature as are the motions of heavenly bodies. The gradual disintegration of memory, for example, can be explained by inertia. As we are presented with ever more sensory information, the residue of earlier impressions ‘slows down' over time. From Hobbes’ point of view, we are essentially very complicated organic machines, responding to the stimuli of the world mechanistically and in accordance with universal laws of human nature.

In Hobbes' view, this mechanistic quality of human psychology implies the subjective nature of normative claims. ‘Love’ and ‘hate’, for instance, are just words we use to describe the things we are drawn to and repelled by, respectively. So, too, the terms ‘good’ and ‘bad’ have no meaning other than to describe our appetites and aversions. Moral terms do not, therefore, describe some objective state of affairs, but are rather reflections of individual tastes and preferences.

In addition to Subjectivism, Hobbes also infers from his mechanistic theory of human nature that humans are necessarily and exclusively self-interested. All men pursue only what they perceive to be in their own individually considered best interests - they respond mechanistically by being drawn to that which they desire and repelled by that to which they are averse. This is a universal claim: it is meant to cover all human actions under all circumstances – in society or out of it, with regard to strangers and friends alike, with regard to small ends and the most generalized of human desires, such as the desire for power and status. Everything we do is motivated solely by the desire to better our own situations, and satisfy as many of our own, individually considered desires as possible. We are infinitely appetitive and only genuinely concerned with our own selves. According to Hobbes, even the reason that adults care for small children can be explicated in terms of the adults' own self-interest (he claims that in saving an infant by caring for it, we become the recipient of a strong sense of obligation in one who has been helped to survive rather than allowed to die).

In addition to being exclusively self-interested, Hobbes also argues that human beings are reasonable. They have in them the rational capacity to pursue their desires as efficiently and maximally as possible. Their reason does not, given the subjective nature of value, evaluate their given ends, rather it merely acts as "Scouts, and Spies, to range abroad, and find the way to the things Desired" (139). Rationality is purely instrumental. It can add and subtract, and compare sums one to another, and thereby endows us with the capacity to formulate the best means to whatever ends we might happen to have.

From these premises of human nature, Hobbes goes on to construct a provocative and compelling argument for why we ought to be willing to submit ourselves to political authority. He does this by imagining persons in a situation prior to the establishment of society, the State of Nature.

According to Hobbes, the justification for political obligation is this: given that men are naturally self-interested, yet they are rational, they will choose to submit to the authority of a Sovereign in order to be able to live in a civil society, which is conducive to their own interests. Hobbes argues for this by imagining men in their natural state, or in other words, the State of Nature. In the State of Nature, which is purely hypothetical according to Hobbes, men are naturally and exclusively self-interested, they are more or less equal to one another, (even the strongest man can be killed in his sleep), there are limited resources, and yet there is no power able to force men to cooperate. Given these conditions in the State of Nature, Hobbes concludes that the State of Nature would be unbearably brutal. In the State of Nature, every person is always in fear of losing his life to another. They have no capacity to ensure the long-term satisfaction of their needs or desires. No long-term or complex cooperation is possible because the State of Nature can be aptly described as a state of utter distrust. Given Hobbes' reasonable assumption that most people want first and foremost to avoid their own deaths, he concludes that the State of Nature is the worst possible situation in which men can find themselves. It is the state of perpetual and unavoidable war.

The situation is not, however, hopeless. Because men are reasonable, they can see their way out of such a state by recognizing the laws of nature, which show them the means by which to escape the State of Nature and create a civil society. The first and most important law of nature commands that each man be willing to pursue peace when others are willing to do the same, all the while retaining the right to continue to pursue war when others do not pursue peace. Being reasonable, and recognizing the rationality of this basic precept of reason, men can be expected to construct a Social Contract that will afford them a life other than that available to them in the State of Nature. This contract is constituted by two distinguishable contracts. First, they must agree to establish society by collectively and reciprocally renouncing the rights they had against one another in the State of Nature. Second, they must imbue some one person or assembly of persons with the authority and power to enforce the initial contract. In other words, to ensure their escape from the State of Nature, they must both agree to live together under common laws, and create an enforcement mechanism for the social contract and the laws that constitute it. Since the sovereign is invested with the authority and power to mete out punishments for breaches of the contract which are worse than not being able to act as one pleases, men have good, albeit self-interested, reason to adjust themselves to the artifice of morality in general, and justice in particular. Society becomes possible because, whereas in the State of Nature there was no power able to "overawe them all", now there is an artificially and conventionally superior and more powerful person who can force men to cooperate. While living under the authority of a Sovereign can be harsh (Hobbes argues that because men's passions can be expected to overwhelm their reason, the Sovereign must have absolute authority in order for the contract to be successful) it is at least better than living in the State of Nature. And, no matter how much we may object to how poorly a Sovereign manages the affairs of the state and regulates our own lives, we are never justified in resisting his power because it is the only thing which stands between us and what we most want to avoid, the State of Nature.

According to this argument, morality, politics, society, and everything that comes along with it, all of which Hobbes calls ‘commodious living' are purely conventional. Prior to the establishment of the basic social contract, according to which men agree to live together and the contract to embody a Sovereign with absolute authority, nothing is immoral or unjust - anything goes. After these contracts are established, however, then society becomes possible, and people can be expected to keep their promises, cooperate with one another, and so on. The Social Contract is the most fundamental source of all that is good and that which we depend upon to live well. Our choice is either to abide by the terms of the contract, or return to the State of Nature, which Hobbes argues no reasonable person could possibly prefer.

Given his rather severe view of human nature, Hobbes nonetheless manages to create an argument that makes civil society, along with all its advantages, possible. Within the context of the political events of his England, he also managed to argue for a continuation of the traditional form of authority that his society had long since enjoyed, while nonetheless placing it on what he saw as a far more acceptable foundation.

b. John Locke

For Hobbes, the necessity of an absolute authority, in the form of a Sovereign, followed from the utter brutality of the State of Nature. The State of Nature was completely intolerable, and so rational men would be willing to submit themselves even to absolute authority in order to escape it. For John Locke, 1632-1704, the State of Nature is a very different type of place, and so his argument concerning the social contract and the nature of men's relationship to authority are consequently quite different. While Locke uses Hobbes’ methodological device of the State of Nature, as do virtually all social contract theorists, he uses it to a quite different end. Locke’s arguments for the social contract, and for the right of citizens to revolt against their king were enormously influential on the democratic revolutions that followed, especially on Thomas Jefferson, and the founders of the United States.

Locke's most important and influential political writings are contained in his Two Treatises on Government. The first treatise is concerned almost exclusively with refuting the argument of Robert Filmer’s Patriarcha, that political authority was derived from religious authority, also known by the description of the Divine Right of Kings, which was a very dominant theory in seventeenth-century England. The second treatise contains Locke’s own constructive view of the aims and justification for civil government, and is titled "An Essay Concerning the True Original Extent and End of Civil Government".

According to Locke, the State of Nature, the natural condition of mankind, is a state of perfect and complete liberty to conduct one's life as one best sees fit, free from the interference of others. This does not mean, however, that it is a state of license: one is not free to do anything at all one pleases, or even anything that one judges to be in one’s interest. The State of Nature, although a state wherein there is no civil authority or government to punish people for transgressions against laws, is not a state without morality. The State of Nature is pre-political, but it is not pre-moral. Persons are assumed to be equal to one another in such a state, and therefore equally capable of discovering and being bound by the Law of Nature. The Law of Nature, which is on Locke’s view the basis of all morality, and given to us by God, commands that we not harm others with regards to their "life, health, liberty, or possessions" (par. 6). Because we all belong equally to God, and because we cannot take away that which is rightfully His, we are prohibited from harming one another. So, the State of Nature is a state of liberty where persons are free to pursue their own interests and plans, free from interference, and, because of the Law of Nature and the restrictions that it imposes upon persons, it is relatively peaceful.

The State of Nature therefore, is not the same as the state of war, as it is according to Hobbes. It can, however devolve into a state of war, in particular, a state of war over property disputes. Whereas the State of Nature is the state of liberty where persons recognize the Law of Nature and therefore do not harm one another, the state of war begins between two or more men once one man declares war on another, by stealing from him, or by trying to make him his slave. Since in the State of Nature there is no civil power to whom men can appeal, and since the Law of Nature allows them to defend their own lives, they may then kill those who would bring force against them. Since the State of Nature lacks civil authority, once war begins it is likely to continue. And this is one of the strongest reasons that men have to abandon the State of Nature by contracting together to form civil government.

Property plays an essential role in Locke's argument for civil government and the contract that establishes it. According to Locke, private property is created when a person mixes his labor with the raw materials of nature. So, for example, when one tills a piece of land in nature, and makes it into a piece of farmland, which produces food, then one has a claim to own that piece of land and the food produced upon it. (This led Locke to conclude that America didn’t really belong to the natives who lived there, because they were, on his view, failing to utilize the basic material of nature. In other words, they didn’t farm it, so they had no legitimate claim to it, and others could therefore justifiably appropriate it.) Given the implications of the Law of Nature, there are limits as to how much property one can own: one is not allowed to take more from nature than one can use, thereby leaving others without enough for themselves. Because nature is given to all of mankind by God for its common subsistence, one cannot take more than his own fair share. Property is the linchpin of Locke’s argument for the social contract and civil government because it is the protection of their property, including their property in their own bodies, that men seek when they decide to abandon the State of Nature.

According to Locke, the State of Nature is not a condition of individuals, as it is for Hobbes. Rather, it is populated by mothers and fathers with their children, or families - what he calls "conjugal society" (par. 78). These societies are based on the voluntary agreements to care for children together, and they are moral but not political. Political society comes into being when individual men, representing their families, come together in the State of Nature and agree to each give up the executive power to punish those who transgress the Law of Nature, and hand over that power to the public power of a government. Having done this, they then become subject to the will of the majority. In other words, by making a compact to leave the State of Nature and form society, they make “one body politic under one government” (par. 97) and submit themselves to the will of that body. One joins such a body, either from its beginnings, or after it has already been established by others, only by explicit consent. Having created a political society and government through their consent, men then gain three things which they lacked in the State of Nature: laws, judges to adjudicate laws, and the executive power necessary to enforce these laws. Each man therefore gives over the power to protect himself and punish transgressors of the Law of Nature to the government that he has created through the compact.

Given that the end of "men's uniting into common-wealths"( par. 124) is the preservation of their wealth, and preserving their lives, liberty, and well-being in general, Locke can easily imagine the conditions under which the compact with government is destroyed, and men are justified in resisting the authority of a civil government, such as a King. When the executive power of a government devolves into tyranny, such as by dissolving the legislature and therefore denying the people the ability to make laws for their own preservation, then the resulting tyrant puts himself into a State of Nature, and specifically into a state of war with the people, and they then have the same right to self-defense as they had before making a compact to establish society in the first place. In other words, the justification of the authority of the executive component of government is the protection of the people’s property and well-being, so when such protection is no longer present, or when the king becomes a tyrant and acts against the interests of the people, they have a right, if not an outright obligation, to resist his authority. The social compact can be dissolved and the process to create political society begun anew.

Because Locke did not envision the State of Nature as grimly as did Hobbes, he can imagine conditions under which one would be better off rejecting a particular civil government and returning to the State of Nature, with the aim of constructing a better civil government in its place. It is therefore both the view of human nature, and the nature of morality itself, which account for the differences between Hobbes' and Locke’s views of the social contract.

c. Jean-Jacques Rousseau

Jean-Jacques Rousseau, 1712-1778, lived and wrote during what was arguably the headiest period in the intellectual history of modern France--the Enlightenment. He was one of the bright lights of that intellectual movement, contributing articles to the Encyclopdie of Diderot, and participating in the salons in Paris, where the great intellectual questions of his day were pursued.

Rousseau has two distinct social contract theories. The first is found in his essay, Discourse on the Origin and Foundations of Inequality Among Men, commonly referred to as the Second Discourse, and is an account of the moral and political evolution of human beings over time, from a State of Nature to modern society. As such it contains his naturalized account of the social contract, which he sees as very problematic. The second is his normative, or idealized theory of the social contract, and is meant to provide the means by which to alleviate the problems that modern society has created for us, as laid out in the Second Discourse.

Rousseau wrote his Second Discourse in response to an essay contest sponsored by the Academy of Dijon. (Rousseau had previously won the same essay contest with an earlier essay, commonly referred to as the First Discourse.) In it he describes the historical process by which man began in a State of Nature and over time ‘progressed' into civil society. According to Rousseau, the State of Nature was a peaceful and quixotic time. People lived solitary, uncomplicated lives. Their few needs were easily satisfied by nature. Because of the abundance of nature and the small size of the population, competition was non-existent, and persons rarely even saw one another, much less had reason for conflict or fear. Moreover, these simple, morally pure persons were naturally endowed with the capacity for pity, and therefore were not inclined to bring harm to one another.

As time passed, however, humanity faced certain changes. As the overall population increased, the means by which people could satisfy their needs had to change. People slowly began to live together in small families, and then in small communities. Divisions of labor were introduced, both within and between families, and discoveries and inventions made life easier, giving rise to leisure time. Such leisure time inevitably led people to make comparisons between themselves and others, resulting in public values, leading to shame and envy, pride and contempt. Most importantly however, according to Rousseau, was the invention of private property, which constituted the pivotal moment in humanity's evolution out of a simple, pure state into one characterized by greed, competition, vanity, inequality, and vice. For Rousseau the invention of property constitutes humanity’s ‘fall from grace’ out of the State of Nature.

Having introduced private property, initial conditions of inequality became more pronounced. Some have property and others are forced to work for them, and the development of social classes begins. Eventually, those who have property notice that it would be in their interests to create a government that would protect private property from those who do not have it but can see that they might be able to acquire it by force. So, government gets established, through a contract, which purports to guarantee equality and protection for all, even though its true purpose is to fossilize the very inequalities that private property has produced. In other words, the contract, which claims to be in the interests of everyone equally, is really in the interests of the few who have become stronger and richer as a result of the developments of private property. This is the naturalized social contract, which Rousseau views as responsible for the conflict and competition from which modern society suffers.

The normative social contract, argued for by Rousseau in The Social Contract (1762), is meant to respond to this sorry state of affairs and to remedy the social and moral ills that have been produced by the development of society. The distinction between history and justification, between the factual situation of mankind and how it ought to live together, is of the utmost importance to Rousseau. While we ought not to ignore history, nor ignore the causes of the problems we face, we must resolve those problems through our capacity to choose how we ought to live. Might never makes right, despite how often it pretends that it can.

The Social Contract begins with the most oft-quoted line from Rousseau: "Man was born free, and he is everywhere in chains" (49). This claim is the conceptual bridge between the descriptive work of the Second Discourse, and the prescriptive work that is to come. Humans are essentially free, and were free in the State of Nature, but the ‘progress' of civilization has substituted subservience to others for that freedom, through dependence, economic and social inequalities, and the extent to which we judge ourselves through comparisons with others. Since a return to the State of Nature is neither feasible nor desirable, the purpose of politics is to restore freedom to us, thereby reconciling who we truly and essentially are with how we live together. So, this is the fundamental philosophical problem that The Social Contract seeks to address: how can we be free and live together? Or, put another way, how can we live together without succumbing to the force and coercion of others? We can do so, Rousseau maintains, by submitting our individual, particular wills to the collective or general will, created through agreement with other free and equal persons. Like Hobbes and Locke before him, and in contrast to the ancient philosophers, all men are made by nature to be equals, therefore no one has a natural right to govern others, and therefore the only justified authority is the authority that is generated out of agreements or covenants.

The most basic covenant, the social pact, is the agreement to come together and form a people, a collectivity, which by definition is more than and different from a mere aggregation of individual interests and wills. This act, where individual persons become a people is "the real foundation of society" (59). Through the collective renunciation of the individual rights and freedom that one has in the State of Nature, and the transfer of these rights to the collective body, a new ‘person', as it were, is formed. The sovereign is thus formed when free and equal persons come together and agree to create themselves anew as a single body, directed to the good of all considered together. So, just as individual wills are directed towards individual interests, the general will, once formed, is directed towards the common good, understood and agreed to collectively. Included in this version of the social contract is the idea of reciprocated duties: the sovereign is committed to the good of the individuals who constitute it, and each individual is likewise committed to the good of the whole. Given this, individuals cannot be given liberty to decide whether it is in their own interests to fulfill their duties to the Sovereign, while at the same time being allowed to reap the benefits of citizenship. They must be made to conform themselves to the general will, they must be “forced to be free” (64).

For Rousseau, this implies an extremely strong and direct form of democracy. One cannot transfer one's will to another, to do with as he or she sees fit, as one does in representative democracies. Rather, the general will depends on the coming together periodically of the entire democratic body, each and every citizen, to decide collectively, and with at least near unanimity, how to live together, i.e., what laws to enact. As it is constituted only by individual wills, these private, individual wills must assemble themselves regularly if the general will is to continue. One implication of this is that the strong form of democracy which is consistent with the general will is also only possible in relatively small states. The people must be able to identify with one another, and at least know who each other are. They cannot live in a large area, too spread out to come together regularly, and they cannot live in such different geographic circumstances as to be unable to be united under common laws. (Could the present-day U.S. satisfy Rousseau’s conception of democracy? It could not. ) Although the conditions for true democracy are stringent, they are also the only means by which we can, according to Rousseau, save ourselves, and regain the freedom to which we are naturally entitled.

Rousseau's social contract theories together form a single, consistent view of our moral and political situation. We are endowed with freedom and equality by nature, but our nature has been corrupted by our contingent social history. We can overcome this corruption, however, by invoking our free will to reconstitute ourselves politically, along strongly democratic principles, which is good for us, both individually and collectively.

3. More Recent Social Contract Theories

a. John Rawls' A Theory of Justice

In 1972, the publication of John Rawls' extremely influential A Theory of Justice brought moral and political philosophy back from what had been a long hiatus of philosophical consideration. Rawls’ theory relies on a Kantian understanding of persons and their capacities. For Rawls, as for Kant, persons have the capacity to reason from a universal point of view, which in turn means that they have the particular moral capacity of judging principles from an impartial standpoint. In A Theory of Justice, Rawls argues that the moral and political point of view is discovered via impartiality. (It is important to note that this view, delineated in A Theory of Justice, has undergone substantial revisions by Rawls, and that he described his later view as "political liberalism".) He invokes this point of view (the general view that Thomas Nagel describes as “the view from nowhere”) by imagining persons in a hypothetical situation, the Original Position, which is characterized by the epistemological limitation of the Veil of Ignorance. Rawls’ original position is his highly abstracted version of the State of Nature. It is the position from which we can discover the nature of justice and what it requires of us as individual persons and of the social institutions through which we will live together cooperatively. In the original position, behind the veil of ignorance, one is denied any particular knowledge of one’s circumstances, such as one’s gender, race, particular talents or disabilities, one’s age, social status, one’s particular conception of what makes for a good life, or the particular state of the society in which one lives. Persons are also assumed to be rational and disinterested in one another’s well-being. These are the conditions under which, Rawls argues, one can choose principles for a just society which are themselves chosen from initial conditions that are inherently fair. Because no one has any of the particular knowledge he or she could use to develop principles that favor his or her own particular circumstances, in other words the knowledge that makes for and sustains prejudices, the principles chosen from such a perspective are necessarily fair. For example, if one does not know whether one is female or male in the society for which one must choose basic principles of justice, it makes no sense, from the point of view of self-interested rationality, to endorse a principle that favors one sex at the expense of another, since, once the veil of ignorance is lifted, one might find oneself on the losing end of such a principle. Hence Rawls describes his theory as “justice as fairness.” Because the conditions under which the principles of justice are discovered are basically fair, justice proceeds out of fairness.

In such a position, behind such a veil, everyone is in the same situation, and everyone is presumed to be equally rational. Since everyone adopts the same method for choosing the basic principles for society, everyone will occupy the same standpoint: that of the disembodied, rational, universal human. Therefore all who consider justice from the point of view of the original position would agree upon the same principles of justice generated out of such a thought experiment. Any one person would reach the same conclusion as any other person concerning the most basic principles that must regulate a just society.

The principles that persons in the Original Position, behind the Veil of Ignorance, would choose to regulate a society at the most basic level (that is, prior even to a Constitution) are called by Rawls, aptly enough, the Two Principles of Justice. These two principles determine the distribution of both civil liberties and social and economic goods. The first principle states that each person in a society is to have as much basic liberty as possible, as long as everyone is granted the same liberties. That is, there is to be as much civil liberty as possible as long as these goods are distributed equally. (This would, for example, preclude a scenario under which there was a greater aggregate of civil liberties than under an alternative scenario, but under which such liberties were not distributed equally amongst citizens.) The second principle states that while social and economic inequalities can be just, they must be available to everyone equally (that is, no one is to be on principle denied access to greater economic advantage) and such inequalities must be to the advantage of everyone. This means that economic inequalities are only justified when the least advantaged member of society is nonetheless better off than she would be under alternative arrangements. So, only if a rising tide truly does carry all boats upward, can economic inequalities be allowed for in a just society. The method of the original position supports this second principle, referred to as the Difference Principle, because when we are behind the veil of ignorance, and therefore do not know what our situation in society will be once the veil of ignorance is lifted, we will only accept principles that will be to our advantage even if we end up in the least advantaged position in society.

These two principles are related to each other by a specific order. The first principle, distributing civil liberties as widely as possible consistent with equality, is prior to the second principle, which distributes social and economic goods. In other words, we cannot decide to forgo some of our civil liberties in favor of greater economic advantage. Rather, we must satisfy the demands of the first principle, before we move on to the second. From Rawls' point of view, this serial ordering of the principles expresses a basic rational preference for certain kinds of goods, i.e., those embodied in civil liberties, over other kinds of goods, i.e., economic advantage.

Having argued that any rational person inhabiting the original position and placing him or herself behind the veil of ignorance can discover the two principles of justice, Rawls has constructed what is perhaps the most abstract version of a social contract theory. It is highly abstract because rather than demonstrating that we would or even have signed to a contract to establish society, it instead shows us what we must be willing to accept as rational persons in order to be constrained by justice and therefore capable of living in a well ordered society. The principles of justice are more fundamental than the social contract as it has traditionally been conceived. Rather, the principles of justice constrain that contract, and set out the limits of how we can construct society in the first place. If we consider, for example, a constitution as the concrete expression of the social contract, Rawls' two principles of justice delineate what such a constitution can and cannot require of us. Rawls’ theory of justice constitutes, then, the Kantian limits upon the forms of political and social organization that are permissible within a just society.

b. David Gauthier

In his 1986 book, Morals by Agreement, David Gauthier set out to renew Hobbesian moral and political philosophy. In that book, he makes a strong argument that Hobbes was right: we can understand both politics and morality as founded upon an agreement between exclusively self-interested yet rational persons. He improves upon Hobbes' argument, however, by showing that we can establish morality without the external enforcement mechanism of the Sovereign. Hobbes argued that men’s passions were so strong as to make cooperation between them always in danger of breaking down, and thus that a Sovereign was necessary to force compliance. Gauthier, however, believes that rationality alone convinces persons not only to agree to cooperate, but to stick to their agreements as well.

We should understand ourselves as individual Robinson Crusoes, each living on our own island, lucky or unlucky in terms of our talents and the natural provisions of our islands, but able to enter into negotiations and deals with one another to trade goods and services with one another. Entering into such agreements is to our own advantage, and so rationality convinces us to both make such agreements and stick to them as well.

Gauthier has an advantage over Hobbes when it comes to developing the argument that cooperation between purely self-interested agents is possible. He has access to rational choice theory and its sophisticated methodology for showing how such cooperation can arise. In particular, he appeals to the model of the Prisoner's Dilemma to show that self-interest can be consistent with acting cooperatively. (There is a reasonable argument to be made that we can find in Hobbes a primitive version of the problem of the Prisoner’s Dilemma.)

According to the story of the Prisoner's Dilemma, two people have been brought in for questioning, conducted separately, about a crime they are suspected to have committed. The police have solid evidence of a lesser crime that they committed, but need confessions in order to convict them on more serious charges. Each prisoner is told that if she cooperates with the police by informing on the other prisoner, then she will be rewarded by receiving a relatively light sentence of one year in prison, whereas her cohort will go to prison for ten years. If they both remain silent, then there will be no such rewards, and they can each expect to receive moderate sentences of two years. And if they both cooperate with police by informing on each other, then the police will have enough to send each to prison for five years. The dilemma then is this: in order to serve her own interests as well as possible, each prisoner reasons that no matter what the other does she is better off cooperating with the police by confessing. Each reasons: "If she confesses, then I should confess, thereby being sentenced to five years instead of ten. And if she does not confess, then I should confess, thereby being sentenced to one year instead of two. So, no matter what she does, I should confess." The problem is that when each reason this way, they each confess, and each goes to prison for five years. However, had they each remained silent, thereby cooperating with each other rather than with the police, they would have spent only two years in prison.

According to Gauthier, the important lesson of the Prisoner's Dilemma is that when one is engaged in interaction such that others’ actions can affect one’s own interests, and vice versa, one does better if one acts cooperatively. By acting to further the interests of the other, one serves one’s own interests as well. We should, therefore, insofar as we are rational, develop within ourselves the dispositions to constrain ourselves when interacting with others. We should become "constrained maximizers" (CMs) rather remain the “straightforward maximizers” (SMs) that we would be in a State of Nature (167).

Both SMs and CMs are exclusively self-interested and rational, but they differ with regard to whether they take into account only strategies, or both the strategies and utilities, of whose with whom they interact. To take into account the others' strategies is to act in accordance with how you expect the others will act. To take into account their utilities is to consider how they will fare as a result of your action and to allow that to affect your own actions. Both SMs and CMs take into account the strategies of the other with whom they interact. But whereas SMs do not take into account the utilities of those with whom they interact, CMs do. And, whereas CMs are afforded the benefits of cooperation with others, SMs are denied such advantage. According to Gauthier, when interacting in Prisoner’s Dilemma-like situations, where the actions of others can affect one’s own outcome, and vice versa, rationality shows that one’s own interest is best pursued by being cooperative, and therefore agents rationally dispose themselves to the constrain the maximization of their own utility by adopting principles of morality. According to Gauthier, rationality is a force strong enough to give persons internal reasons to cooperate. They do not, therefore, need Hobbes’ Sovereign with absolute authority to sustain their cooperation. The enforcement mechanism has been internalized. "Morals by agreement" are therefore created out of the rationality of exclusively self-interested agents.

4. Contemporary Critiques of Social Contract Theory

Given the longstanding and widespread influence that social contract theory has had, it comes as no surprise that it is also the objects of many critiques from a variety of philosophical perspectives. Feminists and race-conscious philosophers, in particular, have made important arguments concerning the substance and viability of social contract theory.

a. Feminist Arguments

For the most part, feminism resists any simple or universal definition. In general though, feminists take women's experiences seriously, as well as the impact that theories and practices have for women’s lives. Given the pervasive influence of contract theory on social, political, and moral philosophy, then, it is not surprising that feminists should have a great deal to say about whether contract theory is adequate or appropriate from the point of view of taking women seriously. To survey all of the feminist responses to social contract theory would carry us well beyond the boundaries of the present article. I will concentrate therefore on just three of those arguments: Carole Pateman’s argument about the relation between the contract and women’s subordination to men, feminist arguments concerning the nature of the liberal individual, and the care argument.

i. The Sexual Contract

Carole Pateman's 1988 book, The Sexual Contract, argues that lying beneath the myth of the idealized contract, as described by Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau, is a more fundamental contract concerning men’s relationship to women. Contract theory represents itself as being opposed to patriarchy and patriarchal right. (Locke’s social contract, for example, is set by him in stark contrast to the work of Robert Filmer who argued in favor of patriarchal power.) Yet the "original pact" (2) that precedes the social contract entered into by equals is the agreement by men to dominate and control women. This ‘original pact’ is made by brothers, literally or metaphorically, who, after overthrowing the rule of the father, then agree to share their domination of the women who were previously under the exclusive control of one man, the father. The change from “classical patriarchalism” (24) to modern patriarchy is a shift, then, in who has power over women. It is not, however, a fundamental change in whether women are dominated by men. Men’s relationships of power to one another change, but women’s relationship to men’s power does not. Modern patriarchy is characterized by a contractual relationship between men, and part of that contract involves power over women. This fact, that one form of patriarchy was not overthrown completely, but rather was replaced with a different form, in which male power was distributed amongst more men, rather than held by one man, is illustrated by Freud’s story of the genesis of civilization. According to that story, a band of brothers, lorded over by a father who maintained exclusive sexual access to the women of the tribe, kill the father, and then establish a contract among themselves to be equal and to share the women. This is the story, whether we understand Freud’s tale to be historically accurate or not, of modern patriarchy and its deep dependence on contract as the means by which men control and dominate women.

Patriarchal control of women is found in at least three paradigmatic contemporary contracts: the marriage contract, the prostitution contract, and the contract for surrogate motherhood. Each of these contracts is concerned with men's control of women, or a particular man’s control of a particular woman generalized. According to the terms of the marriage contract, in most states in the U.S., a husband is accorded the right to sexual access, prohibiting the legal category of marital rape. Prostitution is a case in point of Pateman’s claim that modern patriarchy requires equal access by men to women, in particular sexual access, access to their bodies. And surrogate motherhood can be understood as more of the same, although in terms of access to women’s reproductive capacities. All these examples demonstrate that contract is the means by which women are dominated and controlled. Contract is not the path to freedom and equality. Rather, it is one means, perhaps the most fundamental means, by which patriarchy is upheld.

ii. The Nature of the Liberal Individual

Following Pateman's argument, a number of feminists have also called into question the very nature of the person at the heart of contract theory. The Liberal Individual, the contractor, is represented by the Hobbesian man, Locke’s proprietor, Rousseau’s "Noble Savage," Rawls’s person in the original position, and Gauthier’s Robinson Crusoe. The liberal individual is purported to be universal: raceless, sexless, classless, disembodied, and is taken to represent an abstract, generalized model of humanity writ large. Many philosophers have argued, however, that when we look more closely at the characteristics of the liberal individual, what we find is not a representation of universal humanity, but a historically located, specific type of person. C.B. Macpherson, for example, has argued that Hobbesian man is, in particular, a bourgeois man, with the characteristics we would expect of a person during the nascent capitalism that characterized early modern Europe. Feminists have also argued that the liberal individual is a particular, historical, and embodied person. (As have race-conscious philosophers, such as Charles Mills, to be discussed below.) More specifically, they have argued that the person at the heart of liberal theory, and the social contract, is gendered. Christine Di Stefano, in her 1991 book Configurations of Masculinity, shows that a number of historically important modern philosophers can be understood to develop their theories from within the perspective of masculinity, as conceived of in the modern period. She argues that Hobbes’s conception of the liberal individual, which laid the groundwork for the dominant modern conception of the person, is particularly masculine in that it is conceived as atomistic and solitary and as not owing any of its qualities, or even its very existence, to any other person, in particular its mother. Hobbes’s human, is therefore, radically individual, in a way that is specifically owing to the character of modern masculinity. Virginia Held, in her 1993 book, Feminist Morality, argues that social contract theory implicitly relies on a conception of the person that can be best described as “economic man.” “Economic man” is concerned first and foremost to maximize his own, individually considered interests, and he enters into contracts as a means by which to achieve this end. “Economic man”, however, fails to represent all persons in all times and places. In particular, it fails to adequately represent children and those who provide them with the care they require, who have historically been women. The model of “economic man” cannot, therefore, fairly claim to be a general representation of all persons. Similarly, Annette Baier argues that Gauthier’s conception of the liberal individual who enters into the social contract as a means by which to maximize his own individually considered interests is gendered in that it does not take seriously the position of either children or the women who most usually are responsible for caring for those children.

iii. Arguing from Care

Theorizing from within the emerging tradition of care ethics, feminist philosophers such as Baier and Held argue that social contract theory fails as an adequate account of our moral or political obligations. Social contract theory, in general, only goes so far as to delineate our rights and obligations. But this may not be enough to adequately reveal the full extent of what it means to be a moral person, and how fully to respond to others with whom one interacts through relations of dependence. Baier argues that Gauthier, who conceives of affective bonds between persons as non-essential and voluntary, therefore fails to represent the fullness of human psychology and motivations. She argues that this therefore leads to a crucial flaw in social contract theory. Liberal moral theory is in fact parasitic upon the very relations between persons from which it seeks to liberate us. While Gauthier argues that we are freer the more that we can see affective relations as voluntary, we must nonetheless, in the first place, be in such relationships (e.g., the mother-child relationship) in order to develop the very capacities and qualities lauded by liberal theory. Certain kinds of relationships of dependence, in other words, are necessary in the first place if we are to become the very kinds of persons who are capable of entering into contracts and agreements. In a similar vein, Held has argued that the model of "economic man" fails to capture much of what constitutes meaningful moral relations between people. Understanding human relations in purely contractual terms constitutes, according to her argument “an impoverished view of human aspiration” (194). She therefore suggests that we consider other models of human relationships when looking for insight into morality. In particular, she offers up the paradigm of the mother-child relationship to at least supplement the model of individual self-interested agents negotiating with one another through contracts. Such a model is more likely to match up with many of the moral experiences of most people, especially women.

Feminist critiques of the contractarian approaches to our collective moral and political lives continue to reverberate through social and political philosophy. One such critique, that of Carole Pateman, has influenced philosophers writing outside of feminist traditions.

b. Race-Conscious Argument

Charles Mills' 1997 book, The Racial Contract, is a critique not only of the history of Western political thought, institutions, and practices, but, more specifically, of the history of social contract theory. It is inspired by Carole Pateman’s The Sexual Contract, and seeks to show that non-whites have a similar relationship to the social contract as do women. As such, it also calls into question the supposed universality of the liberal individual who is the agent of contract theory.

Mills' central argument is that there exists a ‘racial contract’ that is even more fundamental to Western society than the social contract. This racial contract determines in the first place who counts as full moral and political persons, and therefore sets the parameters of who can ‘contract in’ to the freedom and equality that the social contract promises. Some persons, in particular white men, are full persons according to the racial contract. As such they are accorded the right to enter into the social contract, and into particular legal contracts. They are seen as fully human and therefore as deserving of equality and freedom. Their status as full persons accords them greater social power. In particular, it accords them the power to make contracts, to be the subjects of the contract, whereas other persons are denied such privilege and are relegated to the status of objects of contracts.

This racial contract is to some extent a meta-contract, which determines the bounds of personhood and parameters of inclusion and exclusion in all the other contracts that come after it. It manifests itself both formally and informally. It is an agreement, originally among European men in the beginning of the modern period, to identify themselves as ‘white' and therefore as fully human, and to identify all others, in particular the natives with whom they were beginning to come into contact, as ‘other’: non-white and therefore not fully human. So, race is not just a social construct, as others have argued, it is more especially a political construct, created to serve a particular political end, and the political purposes of a specific group. The contract allows some persons to treat other persons, as well as the lands they inhabit, as resources to be exploited. The enslavement of millions of Africans and the appropriation of the Americas from those who inhabited them, are examples of this racial contract at work in history (such as Locke’s claim that Native Americans did not own the land they lived on because they did not farm it and therefore did not own it). This contract is not hypothetical, as Hobbes describes the one argued for in his Leviathan. This is an actual contract, or series of contracts, made by real men of history. It is found in such documents as Papal Bulls and Locke’s writings on Native Americans, and acted upon in such historical events as the voyages of discovery made by Europeans and the colonization of Africa, Asia, and the Americas. The racial contract makes possible and justifies some people, in virtue of their alleged superiority, exploiting the peoples, lands, and resources of other races.

From Mills' perspective then, racism is not just an unhappy accident of Western democratic and political ideals. It is not the case that we have a political system that was perfectly conceived and unfortunately imperfectly applied. One of the reasons that we continue to think that the problem of race in the West is relatively superficial, that it does not go all the way down, is the hold that the idealized social contract has on our imagination. We continue to believe, according to Mills, in the myths that social contract theory tells us - that everyone is equal, that all will be treated the same before the law, that the Founding Fathers were committed to equality and freedom for all persons, etc. One of the very purposes of social contract theory, then, is to keep hidden from view the true political reality – some persons will be accorded the rights and freedoms of full persons, and the rest will be treated as sub-persons. The racial contract informs the very structure of our political systems, and lays the basis for the continuing racial oppression of non-whites. We cannot respond to it, therefore, by simply adding more non-whites into the mix of our political institutions, representation, and so on. Rather, we must reexamine our politics in general, from the point of view of the racial contract, and start from where we are, with full knowledge of how our society has been informed by the systematic exclusion of some persons from the realm of politics and contract. This "naturalized" feature of the racial contract, meaning that it tells a story about who we actually are and what is included in our history, is better, according to Mills, because it holds the promise of making it possible for us to someday actually live up to the norms and values that are at the heart of the Western political traditions.

5. Conclusion

Virginia Held has argued that "Contemporary Western society is in the grip of contractual thinking" (193). Contractual models have come to inform a vast variety of relations and interaction between persons, from students and their teachers, to authors and their readers. Given this, it would be difficult to overestimate the effect that social contract theory has had, both within philosophy, and on the wider culture. Social contract theory is undoubtedly with us for the foreseeable future. But so too are the critiques of such theory, which will continue to compel us to think and rethink the nature of both ourselves and our relations with one another.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Baier, Annette. 1988. "Pilgrim's Progress: Review of David Gauthier, Morals by Agreement." Canadian Journal of Philosophy Vol. 18, No. 2. (June 1988): 315-330.
  • Baier, Annette. 1994. Moral Prejudices: Essays on Ethics. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Braybrooke, David. 1976. "The Insoluble Problem of the Social Contract." Dialogue Vol. XV, No. 1: 3-37.
  • DiStefano, Christine. 1991. Configurations of Masculinity: A Feminist Perspective on Modern Political Theory. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Filmer, Robert. ‘Patriarcha' and Other Writings. Cambridge University Press (1991).
  • Gauthier, David. 1986. Morals by Agreement. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gauthier, David. 1988. "Hobbes's Social Contract." Noûs 22: 71-82.
  • Gauthier, David. 1990. Moral Dealing: Contract, Ethics, and Reason. Cornell: Cornell University Press.
  • Gauthier, David. 1991. "Why Contractarianism?" in Vallentyne 1991: 13-30.
  • Gilligan, Carol. 1982. In a Different Voice: Psychological Theory and Women's Development. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Hampton, Jean. 1986. Hobbes and the Social Contract Tradition. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hampton, Jean. 1993. "Feminist Contractarianism." In Antony, Louise M. and Witt, Charlotte (Editors). 1993. A Mind of One's Own: Essays on Reason and Objectivity. Boulder CO: Westview Press, Inc.: 1993: 227-255.
  • Held, Virginia. 1977. "Rationality and Reasonable Cooperation." Social Research (Winter 1977): 708-744.
  • Held, Virginia. 1993. Feminist Morality: Transforming Culture, Society, and Politics. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Hobbes, Thomas. 1651a. Leviathan. C.B Macpherson (Editor). London: Penguin Books (1985)
  • Kavka, Gregory S. 1986. Hobbesian Moral and Political Theory. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Locke, John. Two Treatises of Government and A Letter Concerning Toleration. Yale University Press (2003).
  • Macpherson, C.B. 1973. Democratic Theory: Essays in Retrieval. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Mills, Charles. 1997. The Racial Contract. Cornell University Press.
  • Nozick, Robert. 1974. Anarchy, State and Utopia. New York: Basic Books.
  • Okin, Susan Moller. 1989. Justice, Gender, and the Family. New York: Basic Books.
  • Pateman, Carole. 1988. The Sexual Contract. Stanford: Stanford University Press.
  • Plato. Five Dialogues. (Trans. G.M.A. Grube) Hackett Publishing Company (1981).
  • Plato. Republic. (Trans. G.M.A. Grube, Revised by C.D.C. Reeve) Hackett Publishing Company (1992)
  • Poundstone, William. 1992. Prisoner's Dilemma: John Von Neumann, Game Theory, and the Puzzle of the Bomb. New York: Doubleday.
  • Rawls, John. 1971. A Theory of Justice. Harvard University Press.
  • Rawls, John. 1993. Political Liberalism. Columbia University Press.
  • Rousseau, Jean-Jacques. The Basic Political Writings. (Trans. Donald A. Cress) Hackett Publishing Company (1987).
  • Sandel, Michael. 1982. Liberalism and the Limits of Justice. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Vallentyne, Peter. (Editor). 1991. Contractarianism and Rational Choice: Essays on David Gauthier's Morals by Agreement. New York: Cambridge University Press.

Author Information

Celeste Friend
Hamilton College
U. S. A.


The heart of tolerance is self-control. When we tolerate an activity, we resist our urge to forcefully prohibit the expression of activities that we find unpleasant.  More abstractly, toleration can be understood as a political practice aiming at neutrality, objectivity, or fairness on the part of political agents. These ideas are related in that the goal of political neutrality is deliberate restraint of the power that political authorities have to negate the life activities of its citizens and subjects. Related to toleration is the virtue of tolerance, which can be defined as a tendency toward toleration. Toleration is usually grounded upon an assumption about the importance of the autonomy of individuals. This assumption and the idea of toleration are central ideas in modern liberal theory and practice.

The virtue of toleration is implicit in Socrates' method of allowing many diverse perspectives to be expressed. In  seventeenth century Europe, the concept of tolerance was developed as liberal thinkers sought to limit the coercive actions of government and the Church. They argued that human beings are fallible and should have epistemic modesty. Further, an individual know his or her interests best  and requires tolerance by others in order to find the best way to live.

The following article provides a conceptual and historical overview of the concept of toleration, surveying thinkers such as Socrates, John Locke, John Stuart Mill, Immanuel Kant, John Rawls and other contemporary political philosophers who have weighed in on this important yet problematic idea.


Table of Contents

  1. Conceptual Analysis
  2. Historical Development
    1. Early History
    2. The 17th Century
    3. The 18th Century
    4. The 19th Century
    5. The 20th Century
  3. Epistemological Toleration
    1. Socrates
    2. Milton
    3. Locke
    4. Mill
    5. The Problem of Relativism
  4. Moral Toleration
    1. The Paradox of Toleration
    2. Tolerance vs. Indifference
  5. Political Toleration
    1. John Rawls
    2. Risks and Benefits
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Conceptual Analysis

The English words, 'tolerate', 'toleration', and ‘tolerance’ are derived from the Latin terms tolerare and tolerantia, which imply enduring, suffering, bearing, and forbearance. Ancient Greek terms, which may also have influenced philosophical thinking on toleration, include: phoretos which means bearable, endurable, or phoreo, literally 'to carry'; and anektikos meaning bearable, sufferable, tolerable, from anexo, 'to hold up'.

Today, when we say that someone has a 'high tolerance for pain,' we mean that he or she is able to endure pain. This ordinary way of thinking is useful for understanding the idea of toleration and the virtue of tolerance: it underscores the fact that toleration is directed by an agent toward something perceived as negative. It would be odd to say, for example, that someone has a high tolerance for pleasure.

With this in mind, we can formulate a general definition of toleration that involves three interrelated conditions. When an agent tolerates something:

(1) the agent holds a negative judgment about this thing;

(2) the agent has the power to negate this thing; and

(3) the agent deliberately refrains from negation.

The first condition requires a negative judgment, which can be anything from disapproval to disgust. Judgment here is meant to be a broad concept that can include emotions, dispositions, tastes, and reasoned evaluations. This negative judgment inclines the agent toward a negative action toward the thing that is perceived as being negative. This broadly Stoic conception of judgment is a common assumption in discussions of toleration. Defenders of toleration assume that we can, to a certain extent, voluntarily control the expression of our negative reactions by opposing them with different, countervailing, judgments. Although judgments and emotions are both thought to have motivating force, they can be resisted by some other judgment, habit or virtue.

The entity toward which an agent has a negative judgment can be an event, an object, or a person, although with regard to tolerance as a moral and political disposition, the entity is usually thought to be a person. Although we speak of tolerating pain, for example, the moral and political emphasis is on tolerating some other person, a group of people, or their activities.

The second condition states that the agent has the power to negate the entity in question. Toleration is concerned with resisting the temptation to actively negate the thing in question. To distinguish toleration from cowardice or weakness of will the agent must have some capacity to enact his negative judgment. Toleration occurs when the agent could actively negate or destroy the person or object in question, but chooses not to.

The word negate is used here in a broad sense that allows for a variety of negative reactions. Negative actions can include: expressions of condemnation, acts of avoidance, or violent attacks. The continuum of negations is decidedly vague. It is not clear, for example, whether condemnation and avoidance are negations of the same sort as violent action. Despite the vagueness of the continuum of negative activities, the focal point of the second criterion is the power to negate: toleration is restraint of the power to negate.

The third condition states that the agent deliberately refrains from exercising his power to negate. Tolerant agents deliberately choose not to negate those things they view negatively. The negative formulation, 'not negating,' is important because toleration is not the same thing as positive evaluation, approbation, or approval.

Tolerant restraint of the negative judgment is supposed to be free and deliberate: one refrains from negating the thing because one has a reason not to negate it and is free to act. Good reasons for toleration are plural. They include: respect for autonomy; a general commitment to pacifism; concern for other virtues such as kindness and generosity; pedagogical concerns; a desire for reciprocity; and a sense of modesty about one's ability to judge the beliefs and actions of others. Each of these provides us with a reason for thinking that it is good not to negate the thing in question. As mentioned already, there also may be other non-tolerant reasons for refraining from negation: fear, weakness of will, profit motive, self-interest, arrogance, and so forth.

Although there are many reasons to be tolerant, traditional discussions have emphasized respect for autonomy and pedagogical concerns. Underlying both of these approaches is often a form of self-conscious philosophical modesty that is linked to the value of respect for autonomy. As John Stuart Mill and others have argued, individuals ought to be left to pursue their own good in their own way in part because each individual knows himself and his own needs and interests best. This view does, however, leave us with a lingering problem as toleration can easily slip toward moral skepticism and relativism. It is important to note then that toleration is a positive value that is not based upon total moral skepticism. Proponents of toleration think that toleration is good not because they are unsure of their moral values but, rather, because toleration fits within a scheme of moral values that includes values such as autonomy, peace, cooperation, and other values that are thought to be good for human flourishing.

2. Historical Development

a. Early History

The spirit of tolerance is evident in Socrates' dialogical method as a component of his search for truth. Throughout the early Platonic dialogues, Socrates tolerantly allows his interlocutors to pursue the truth wherever this pursuit might lead. And he encourages his interlocutors to offer refutations so that the truth might be revealed. Sometimes Socrates' tolerance can appear to go too far. The Euthyrphro concludes, for example, with Socrates allowing Euthyphro to proceed in the prosecution of a questionable court case. And Socrates' relationship with Alcibiades, as discussed in the Symposium, shows Socrates as perhaps too tolerant toward this reckless Athenian youth. In the Gorgias (at 458a) Socrates describes himself in terms that establish a link between philosophical method and a form of toleration. Socrates says,

And what kind of man am I? One of those who would gladly be refuted if anything I say is not true, and would gladly refute another who says what is not true, but would be no less happy to be refuted myself than to refute, for I consider that a greater benefit, inasmuch as it is a greater boon to be delivered from the worst of evils oneself than to deliver another.

For Socrates, then, the pursuit of truth is linked to an open mind, although of course this form of dialogical toleration is supposed to lead to a unitary vision of the truth.

One can see a more developed form of tolerance celebrated in the Stoicism of Epictetus (55-135 C.E.) and Marcus Aurelius (121-180 C.E.). The Stoic idea is that we should focus on those things we can control—our own opinions and behaviors—while ignoring those things we cannot control, especially the opinions and behaviors of others. The Stoic idea is linked to resignation and apathy, as is clear in the case of Epictetus, whose social position—raised as a Roman slave—might explain his advice about bearing and forbearing. Of course, the problem here is that slavish forbearance is not the same as tolerance: it seems clear that tolerance properly requires the power to negate, which the slave does not possess. With the Emperor Marcus Aurelius, however, tolerance is seen as a virtue of power. Tolerance might be linked to other virtues of power such as mercy and benevolence, as suggested, for example by Seneca. However, it is important to note that the Stoic approach to tolerance was not explicitly linked to a general idea about political respect for autonomy and freedom of conscience, as it is in the modern liberal tradition. Moreover, Roman political life was not nearly as tolerant as modern political life. For example, although Marcus' Meditations contain many passages invoking the spirit of tolerance, Marcus was responsible for continuing the persecution of Christians.

Religious traditions provide further historical background for the idea of toleration. For example, the spirit of tolerance can be discovered in the Christian Gospel's message of loving enemies, forgiving others, and refraining from judging others. Christian tolerance is linked to other virtues such as charity and self-sacrifice. Furthermore, it seems to go beyond tolerance toward a self-abnegating type of love and acceptance. Christ's command to love your enemies is one example of this attempt to go beyond tolerance. It should be noted that other religious traditions also contain resources for developing toleration. For example, Buddhist compassion can be linked to the idea of toleration. Indeed, in the third century B.C.E., the Buddhist emperor of India, Ashoka, called for official religious toleration. Likewise, in the 16th Century C.E., the Islamic emperor Akhbar made a similar attempt at establishing religious toleration on the Indian subcontinent.

Despite these antecedents, toleration does not become a serious subject of philosophical and political concern in Europe until the 16th and 17th Centuries. During the Renaissance and Reformation of the 15th and 16th Centuries, humanists such as Erasmus (1466-1536), De Las Casas (1484-1566), and Montaigne (1533-1592) asserted the autonomy of human reason against the dogmatism of the Church. Although religious authorities reacted with the formation of the Inquisition and the Index of Forbidden Books, by the 17th Century philosophers were seriously considering the question of toleration.

b. The 17th Century

Following the divisions created by the Lutheran Reformation and the Counter-Reformation, Europe was decimated by war and violence fomented in the name of religion, which culminated in the Thirty Years War (1618-1648). Through events such as these scholars became acutely aware of the destructive power of intolerance and sought to limit this destructive force by re-examining the biblical roots of toleration and by re-considering the relation between religious belief and political power. Additional influences on the cultural landscape of Europe during this time include the struggle to define sovereignty and to "purify" religion in Britain during the British Civil Wars (1640-1660), as well as increased information about cultural differences with the beginning of global exploration. Among the thinkers of this period, those who defended tolerance were Milton (1608-1674), Bayle (1647-1706), Spinoza (1634-1677), and Locke (1632-1704).

One of the worries of the humanist thinkers of the Reformation was whether it was possible to have infallible knowledge of the Divine Will such that one could justify the persecution of heretics. This concern with human fallibility lies at the heart of what will be described subsequently as "epistemological toleration." When recognition of human fallibility is combined with critique of political and ecclesiastical power, more robust forms of political toleration develop.

In this vein, Spinoza concluded his Theological-Political Treatise (1670) with an argument for freedom of thought. It is not surprising that Spinoza should have written this treatise, for he was himself a product of a tolerant society: he was a Portuguese Jew living in Holland. Indeed, the 17th Century saw the rise of toleration in practice in certain parts of Europe, perhaps as a result of increased trade and social mobility. Spinoza's argument for toleration focuses on three claims: first, he claims that it is impossible for the state to effectively curtail liberty of thought; second, he claims that liberty of thought can in fact be allowed without detriment to state power; and finally, Spinoza argues that political authority should focus on controlling actions and not on restricting thought. This emphasis on the difference between thought and action is crucial for subsequent discussions of toleration in Locke, Mill, and Kant.

Somewhat different versions of Spinoza's basic insights can be found in Locke’s famous Letter Concerning Toleration (1689), an essay that was written during Locke's exile in Holland. Locke's argument focuses specifically on the conflict between political authority and religious belief. He articulated a view of toleration based on the epistemological claim that it is impossible for the state to coerce genuine religious belief. He argued that the state should refrain from interfering in the religious beliefs of its subjects, except when these religious beliefs lead to behaviors or attitudes that run counter to the security of the state. This exception allowed him to conclude that the state need not tolerate Catholics who were loyal to a foreign authority or atheists whose lack of religious conviction left them entirely untrustworthy.

c. The 18th Century

In the 18th Century, discussion of toleration was tied to the problem of skepticism and to a more sustained critique of absolutism in politics. Voltaire (1694-1778), who expressed his admiration for the development of religious tolerance in England in his Philosophical Letters (1734), was extremely worried about the tendency of religion to become violent and intolerant. Moreover, he suffered under the intolerant hands of the French authorities: he was thrown in jail for his views and his books were censored and publicly burned. Religious tolerance forms the theme of his Treatise on Tolerance (1763), which argues vigorously for tolerance even though it retains a bias toward Christianity. A concise summary of Voltaire's argument for tolerance can be found in the entry on Tolerance in his Philosophical Dictionary (1764). Voltaire's claim is that toleration follows from human frailty and error. Since none of us has perfect knowledge, and since we are all weak, inconsistent, liable to fickleness and error, we should pardon one another for our failings. Voltaire's approach focuses on tolerance at the level of personal interaction and risks slipping toward moral skepticism and relativism: like his contemporary David Hume (1711-1777), Voltaire presented a skeptical challenge to orthodox belief.

Immanuel Kant (1724-1804), in response to skeptics such as Voltaire and Hume, tried to avoid skepticism while focusing on the limits of human knowledge and the limits of political power. In his essay, "What is Enlightenment?" (1784), Kant argues for an enlightened form of political power that would allow subjects to argue among themselves, so long as they remained obedient to authority. This position is further clarified by Kant's claim in Perpetual Peace (1795) that philosophers should be allowed and encouraged to speak publicly. Kant's point in this later essay is that public debate and discussion lead to the truth, and that kings should have nothing to fear from the truth. Kant's views on religious toleration are clarified in his Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone (1793). Here Kant argues against religious intolerance by pointing out that although we are certain of our moral duties, human beings do not have apodictic certainty of God's commands. Thus a religious belief that demands a contravention of morality (such as the burning of a heretic) can never be justified.

Bridging the gap between the Old World and the New World, the writings of Thomas Paine (1737-1809) and Thomas Jefferson (1743-1826) express a theory of toleration that is tied directly to political practice. Paine's and Jefferson’s ideas followed Locke’s. Not only were they critical of unrestrained political power but they were also committed to an ecumenical approach to religious belief known as deism. Paine makes it clear in his Rights of Man (1791) that toleration for religious diversity is essential because political and ecclesiastical authorities do not have the capacity to adjudicate matters of conscience. "Mind thine own concerns. If he believes not as thou believest, it is a proof that thou believest not as he believeth, and there is no earthly power can determine between you."

At the end of the 18th Century, we see tolerant ideas embodied in practice in the U.S. Constitution's Bill of Rights—the first 10 Amendments to the Constitution (ratified in 1791). Collectively these amendments serve to restrain political power. Specifically, the First Amendment states that there can be no law, which prohibits freedom of religion, freedom of speech, freedom of the press, freedom of assembly, and freedom to petition to the government. Subsequent developments in U.S. Constitutional law have led to a tradition of respect for citizens' freedom of thought, speech, and action.

d. The 19th Century

In the 19th Century, the idea of toleration was developed further in line with the liberal, enlightenment idea that moral autonomy is essential to human flourishing. The most famous argument for toleration in the 19th Century was made by John Stuart Mill in On Liberty (1859). Mill argues here that the only proper limit of liberty is harm: one is entitled to be as free as possible, except where one's liberty poses a threat to the well-being of someone else: "the only purpose for which power can rightfully be exercised over any member of a civilized community, against his will, is to prevent harm to others."

Mill expands the notion of privacy that was implicit in Locke and Kant to argue that political power should have no authority to regulate those activities and interests of individuals that are purely private and have no secondary effects on others. Mill also vigorously argues that freedom of thought is essential for the development of knowledge. Mill's general approach is utilitarian: he claims that individuals will be happier if their private differences are tolerated and that society in general will be better off if individuals are left to pursue their own good in their own way.

In the 19th Century and into the early 20th Century, religious toleration was also a subject of consideration for thinkers such as Soren Kierkegaard (1813-1855), Ralph Waldo Emerson (1803-1882), and William James (1842-1910), who emphasized the subjective nature of religious faith. For example, in his Varieties of Religious Experience (1902), James argued that religious experience was diverse and not subject to a definitive interpretation. Although this fits with James's larger metaphysical commitment to pluralism, his point is that religious commitment is personal—a matter of what he calls in another essay, "the will to believe." It is up to each individual to decide for himself what he will believe: if we properly understand the nature of religious belief, we should respect the religious liberty of others and learn to tolerate our differences.

e. The 20th Century

In the 20th Century, toleration has become an important component of what is now known as liberal theory. The bloody history of the 20th Century has led many to believe that toleration is needed to end political and religious violence. Toleration has been defended by liberal philosophers and political theorists such as John Dewey, Isaiah Berlin, Karl Popper, Michael Walzer, Ronald Dworkin, and John Rawls. It has been criticized by Herbert Marcuse and others such as Iris Young who worry that toleration and its ideal of state neutrality is merely another hegemonic Western ideology. Toleration has been the explicit subject of many recent works in political philosophy by Susan Mendus, John Horton, Preston King, and Bernard Williams. Much of the current discussion focuses on responding to John Rawls, whose theory of "political liberalism" conceives of toleration as a pragmatic response to the fact of diversity (see "Political Toleration" below). A recurring question in the current debate is whether there can be a more substantive commitment to toleration that does not lead to the paradoxical consequence that the tolerant must tolerate those who are intolerant.

Further recent discussion, by David Heyd, Glenn Newey, and others, has attempted to re-establish the link between tolerance and virtue. These writers wonder whether tolerance is in fact a virtue and if so, what sort of a virtue it is. A concern for racial equality, gender neutrality, an end of prejudice, respect for cultural and ethnic difference, and a general commitment to multiculturalism has fueled ongoing debates about the nature of toleration in our age of globalization and homogenization. Finally, in the U.S., First Amendment Law has developed to allow for a broad idea of freedom of speech, freedom of the press, and freedom of religion. And under the influence of an interpretation of the equal protection clause of the 14th Amendment, mechanisms to ensure equality have given support to those minority groups who were once the victims of political intolerance.

3. Epistemological Toleration

An epistemological argument for toleration can be traced to Socrates. However, this ideal becomes explicit in the thinking of Milton, Locke, and Mill. The epistemological claim is that one should tolerate the opinions and beliefs of the other because it is either impossible to coerce belief or because such coercion is not the most useful pedagogical approach. This idea can be developed into a claim about the importance of diversity, dialogue, and debate for the establishment of truth. Finally, this approach might lead to a form of relativism or skepticism that puts the idea of toleration itself at risk.

a. Socrates

Socratic tolerance is discovered if we take seriously Socrates' claims to ignorance. Socratic ignorance is linked to virtues, such as sophrosyne (self-control), modesty and tolerance. These virtues are essential components in the formation of the philosophical community and the pursuit of philosophical truth. Throughout Plato's dialogues, Socrates restrains himself deliberately—he modestly claims ignorance and allows others to develop their own positions and make their own mistakes—out of recognition that this is the best, perhaps the only, way to proceed in the communal pursuit of truth. Socrates' main goal is to discover the truth through open-minded debate. But there would be no dialogue and indeed no education without tolerance. Socrates' commitment to tolerance is part of his epistemological faith in the autonomy of reason. We each must discover the truth for ourselves by way of disciplined, modest, and tolerant dialogue.

b. Milton

Centuries later, John Milton's Areopagitica (1644) offers a similar defense of the truth. Milton vigorously defended freedom of speech in response to a censorship decree of the English parliament. His argument relies upon the epistemological claim that open dialogue supported by a tolerant government fosters the development of truth. Milton's basic assumption is that the truth is able to defend itself in a free debate. "Let truth and falsehood grapple; who ever knew truth put to the worse, in a free and open encounter?" Milton further argues that outward conformity to orthodoxy is not the same as genuine belief.

c. Locke

These ideas were developed further by Locke in his Letter Concerning Toleration. Locke argues that the civil and ecclesiastical authorities ought to tolerate diversity of belief because one cannot force another human being to have faith. In a claim that is reminiscent of Milton, Locke claims "the truth certainly would do well enough if she were left to shift for herself… She is not taught by laws, nor has she any need of force to procure her entrance into the minds of men." This is so because the authority of judgment resides within the free individual. It is impossible to force someone to believe something for external reasons. Rather, truth must be arrived at and believed for internal reasons.

This epistemological claim is the focal point of Jeremy Waldron's recent critique of Locke’s account. Waldron claims that Locke's argument is weak because it relies upon the false assumption that beliefs cannot be coerced. The point is that we often believe things quite sincerely without any good reason whatsoever. Moreover, Waldron argues that the epistemological argument is too weak to provide a moral limitation on coercion. Even though coercion cannot produce genuine belief, an intolerant regime may not be interested in producing genuine belief. It may simply be interested in guaranteeing conformity. Waldron's point is important: the epistemological critique is useful only if one is committed to the claim that genuine belief in the truth is an important political or moral value. An epistemological argument for toleration must claim not only that it is impractical or impossible to impose belief upon others, but also that we ought to value genuine commitment over mere conformity.

d. Mill

Mill's epistemological argument is quite similar to Locke's, although Mill goes farther in advocating freedom of speech as essential for the discovery of truth. Mill's epistemological argument begins with the assumption that individuals know best what is good for them. This claim runs counter to the traditional Platonic claim that often individuals do not know what is in their own best interest. Mill supports his claim by pointing out that the individual always has the best access to his/her own interests and desires: others do not have access to the kinds of internal evidence that would allow them to judge for the individual. It is important to note that Mill does not equate this access problem with relativism. Indeed, in his essay Utilitarianism (1863), he famously defends a hierarchy of goods based on the fact that those who have experienced both "lower" and "higher" goods will prefer the higher ones (for example, “it is better to be Socrates dissatisfied than a fool satisfied"). The epistemological point remains the same here, however: it is up to the individual to judge for himself about what is good for him.

Mill's general argument for freedom of thought is based upon a recognition of human fallibility and on the need for dialogue and debate. Mill's argument for freedom of thought in On Liberty contains the following claims. (1) Silenced opinions may be true. To assume they are not is to assume that we are infallible. (2) Even false opinions may contain valid points of contention and parts of the truth. To know the whole of truth we might have to weave together parts of truth from different sources. (3) To claim to know the truth means that we are able to defend it against all vigorous opposition. Thus we need to be able to hear and respond to false opinions in order to know all of the arguments for a proposition. (4) Truth that is not continuously and vigorously contested becomes mere superstition. Such dogmatically held superstitions may thus crumble before even weak opposition and will not be heartily believed or defended.

e. The Problem of Relativism

Like Socrates, Mill and Locke both arrive at the notion of toleration from a non-relativistic understanding of belief and truth. However, under the general rubric of epistemological toleration we might also include the sort of toleration that follows from skepticism or relativism. For the relativist or skeptic, since we cannot know the truth or since all truths are relative, we ought to be tolerant of those who hold different points of view. Contemporary American philosopher, Richard Rorty has articulated an argument something like this. The problem with this approach is the same problem with all sorts of skepticism and relativism: either the claim self-referentially undermines itself or it provides us with no compelling reason to believe it. If we are skeptical about knowledge, then we have no way of knowing that toleration is good. Likewise, if truth is relative to a system of thought, then the claim that toleration is required is itself merely a relatively justified claim. The form of epistemological toleration espoused by Mill, at least, attempts to avoid these problems by appealing to a form of fallibilism that is not completely skeptical or relativistic. Mill's point is not that there is no truth but, rather, that toleration is required for us to come to know the truth.

4. Moral Toleration

We have seen that epistemological concerns can lead us to toleration. Moral concerns can also bring us to toleration. Tolerance as a moral virtue might be linked to other moral virtues such as modesty and self-control. However, the most common moral value that is thought to ground toleration is a concern for autonomy. We ought to refrain from negating the other when concern for the other's autonomy provides us with a good reason not to act. Toleration that follows from a commitment to autonomy should not be confused with moral relativism. Moral relativism holds that values are relative to culture or context. A commitment to autonomy, in opposition to this, holds that autonomy is good in a non-relative sense. A commitment to autonomy might require that I allow another person to do something that I find abhorrent, not because I believe that values are relative, but because I believe that autonomy is so important that it requires me to refrain from negating the autonomous action of another free agent. Of course, there are limits here. Autonomous action that violates the autonomy of another cannot be tolerated.

Mill's account of the principle of liberty is helpful for understanding this idea of toleration. Mill tells us that we should be given as much liberty as possible, as long as our liberty does not harm others. This is in fact a recipe for toleration. Mill's argument follows from certain basic assumptions about individuals.

1. Each individual has a will of his own.
2. Each individual is better off when not compelled to do better.
3. Each individual knows best what is good for him.
4. Each individual is motivated to attain his own good and to avoid actions that are contrary to his self-interest.
5. Self-regarding thought and activity can be distinguished from its effects upon others.

Some of these claims (for example, #3) are linked to epistemological toleration. However, the point here is not only that individuals know what is in their own self-interest but also that it is good for individuals to be able to pursue their own good in their own way. Such an approach makes several important metaphysical assumptions about the nature of human being: that autonomy is possible and important, that individuals do know their own good, that there is a distinction between self-regarding action and actions that effects others. Moral toleration follows from these sorts of claims about human being.

a. The Paradox of Toleration

Of course, toleration and respect for autonomy are not simple ideas. Much has been made about the so-called "paradox of toleration": the fact that toleration seems to ask us to tolerate those things we find intolerable. Toleration does require that we refrain from enacting the negative consequences of our negative judgments. This becomes paradoxical when we find ourselves confronting persons, attitudes, or behaviors, which we vigorously reject: we then must, paradoxically, tolerate that which we find intolerable. This becomes especially difficult when the other who is to be tolerated expresses views or activities that are themselves intolerant.

One way of resolving this paradox is to recognize that there is a distinction between first-order judgments and second-order moral commitments. First-order judgments include emotional reactions and other practical judgments that focus on concrete and particular attitudes and behaviors. Second-order moral commitments include more complicated judgments that aim beyond emotion and particularity toward rational universal principles. With regard to the paradox of toleration there is a conflict between a first-order reaction against something and a second-order commitment to the principle of respecting autonomy or to the virtues of modesty or self-control. The paradox is resolved by recognizing that this second-order commitment trumps the first-order reaction: principle is supposed to outweigh emotion. Thus we might have good reasons (based upon our second-order commitments) to refrain from following through on the normal consequences of negative first-order judgments. However, when there is a genuine conflict of second-order commitments, that is, when the tolerant commitment to autonomy runs up against an intolerant rejection of autonomy, then there is no need to tolerate. In other words the paradox is resolved when we realize that toleration is not a commitment to relativism but, rather, that it is a commitment to the value of autonomy and to the distinction between first-order judgments and second-order moral commitments.

b. Tolerance vs. Indifference

Of course, the ideal of toleration is a difficult one to enact. This difficulty is related to the tension between first-order reactions and second-order commitments that is found within the spiritual economy of an individual. This is why the idea of tolerance as a virtue is important. Virtues are tendencies or habits toward good action. In the case of the virtue of tolerance, the tendency is toward respect for the autonomy of others and toward the self-discipline necessary for deliberately restraining first-order reactions. Virtues are usually thought to be integrated into a system of virtues. Tolerance is no exception. The virtue of tolerance is closely related to other virtues such as self-control, modesty, generosity, kindness, mercy, and forgiveness. One must be careful, however, not to conclude that the virtue of tolerance is a tendency toward indifference or apathy. Tolerance demands that we moderate and control our passions in light of some larger good, whether that good be respect for autonomy or an interest in self-control; tolerance does not demand that we completely refrain from judging another free agent.

Moral toleration asks us to restrain some of our most powerful first-order reactions: negative reactions to persons, attitudes, and behaviors which we find repugnant. Without the tension between first-order reactions and second-order commitment, toleration is merely indifference. Indifference usually indicates a failure at the level of first-order judgment: when we are indifferent, we do not have any reaction, negative or positive, to the other. Such a state of indifference is not virtuous. Indeed, it would be vicious and wrong not to react strongly against injustice or violations of autonomy.

We often confuse indifference with toleration. However, indifference is flawed as a human response for two reasons. First, it rejects the truth of first-order reactions. First-order reactions should not be ignored. Our emotional responses are important ways in which we connect with the world around us. When we react negatively to something, this emotional reaction provides important information about the world and ourselves. Tolerance does not ask us to deaden our emotional responses to others; rather it asks us to restrain the negative consequences of our negative emotional responses out of deference to a more universal set of commitments. Second, indifference is often closely related to general skepticism about moral judgment. The moral skeptic claims that no set of values is true. From this perspective, both first-order reactions and second-order commitments are mere tastes or preferences without any final moral significance. From this skepticism, indifference with regard to any moral evaluation is cultivated because all of our moral values are thought to be equally groundless. The difficulty here is that moral skepticism cannot lead to the conclusion that it is good to be tolerant, since the skeptic holds that no moral value can be justified. If we claim that toleration is good and that tolerance is a virtue, toleration cannot be the same thing as indifference.

This distinction between tolerance and indifference is important for explaining the spiritual disruption that occurs when we strive to become tolerant. Indeed, the difficulty of toleration can be understood in terms of the difficulty of the middle path between indifference and dogmatism. Indifference is easy and satisfying because it sets us free, as it were, from the difficult human task of judging. Likewise, dogmatism is easy and satisfying because it follows from a seamless synthesis of first-order reaction and second-order commitment. Toleration is the middle path in which there is a conflict between first-order reaction and second-order commitment. Toleration thus requires self-consciousness and self-control in order to coordinate conflicting parts of the spiritual economy. The discipline required for toleration is part of any idea of education: we must learn to distance ourselves from first-order reactions in order to move toward universal principles. First-order reactions are often wrong or incomplete, as are immediate sense perceptions. And yet, education does not ask us to give up on first-order reactions or sense perceptions. Rather, it asks us to be disciplined and self-critical, so that we might control first-order reactions in order to uphold more important principles.

5. Political Toleration

Moral toleration emphasizes a moral commitment to the value of autonomy. Although it is linked, by Mill, for example to a political idea about restraint of state power, moral toleration is ultimately concerned with clarifying the second-order principle that is supposed to lead to toleration.

While moral toleration is about relations between agents, political toleration is about restraint of political power. The modern liberal state is usually not thought to be a moral agent. Rather, the state is supposed to be something like a third party referee: it is not thought to be one of the parties engaged directly in the process of judgment and negation. Political toleration is thus an ideal that holds that the political referee should be impartial and unbiased. The term toleration has been used, since Locke, in this political context to describe a principle of state neutrality. The connection between moral and political toleration can be understood in terms of the history of the pre-modern era when the state was an agent—a monarch, for example—who had particular judgments and the power to negate. As the idea of the state has evolved since the 17th Century toward liberal democratic notions of self-government and civil rights, the notion of political toleration has evolved to mean something like state indifference. Political toleration is now thought to entail respect for privacy, separation of church and state, and a general respect for human rights.

a. John Rawls

In the 20th Century, the idea of political toleration has developed, especially under the influence of John Rawls (1921-2002) and his books, Theory of Justice (1971) and Political Liberalism (1995). Rawls' approach attempts to be neutral about moral values in order to establish political principles of toleration. Rawls argues for toleration in a pragmatic fashion as that which works best to achieve political unity and an idea of justice among diverse individuals. Although the idea of political toleration has been most vigorously defended by Rawls, it also forms the basis of other pragmatic and political accounts of toleration, including those of John Dewey, Jürgen Habermas, Michael Walzer, and Richard Rorty. The danger with this approach is that it tends toward relativism by self-consciously limiting itself from articulating a metaphysical defense of autonomy and toleration. The difficulty is that the idea of state neutrality can become paradoxical: a state that is neutral about everything will undermine its own existence.

The idea of political toleration begins from the claim that diverse individuals will come to tolerate one another by developing what Rawls called "overlapping consensus": individuals and groups with diverse metaphysical views or comprehensive schemes will find reasons to agree about certain principles of justice that will include principles of toleration. This is in part an empirical or historical argument about the way in which diverse individuals or groups eventually resolve their differences by way of a pragmatic commitment to toleration as a modus vivendi, or means of life. One could trace this idea back to Hobbes' idea of the social contract as a peace treaty. Diverse individuals in the state of nature will, according to Hobbes's argument in The Leviathan (1651), engage in the war of all against all. This war is ultimately unsatisfying and so individuals relinquish their warring power and create the social contract. The problem is that this pragmatic account leaves us without a metaphysical justification of the principles of toleration. Rather it comes to toleration from the pragmatic assumption that diverse individuals motivated by self-interest will agree to support the neutral state, which is then supposed to act as a referee in their disputes. Of course, Hobbes' account of the absolute sovereignty of the Leviathan calls into question the idea that a social contract view will always lead to a tolerant liberal state.

Rawls' idea of "justice as fairness" attempts to set limits to political power without trying to evaluate the relative merits of different conceptions of the good. Rawls clarified his approach by insisting that the principles of justice are political and not moral principles. They are based upon what he called "reasonable pluralism." What he means by this is that the principles of toleration will be agreed to by individuals from diverse perspectives because these principles will appear reasonable to each individual despite their differences. The idea of toleration results from a political consensus that is developed by way of the ideal social contract that Rawls describes at length in Theory of Justice. Like Mill, Rawls theory of justice claims that the first principle of justice is the liberty principle: "Each person has an equal right to a fully adequate scheme of equal basic liberties which is compatible with a similar scheme of liberties for all." These basic civil liberties form the basis for political toleration.

b. Risks and Benefits

Political liberalism focuses on the problem of diversity without appealing to a larger metaphysical theory. This problem is exacerbated when political liberalism takes up the question of international human rights and the problem of intolerant groups or individual who demand to be tolerated. Political liberalism aims at the creation of a global human rights regime that is supposed to support politically tolerant states and that is sensitive to the issue of group rights. From the perspective of political liberalism, human rights—basic defenses against the intolerant expansion of state power—are thought to be the result of overlapping political consensus. From this perspective, human rights, such as the right to autonomy that forms the basis of moral toleration, are thought to be, not metaphysical givens, but the conditions for the possibility of political consensus building.

The idea of a developing "overlapping consensus" in international affairs was articulated in the 1950's by Jacques Maritain and was developed in practice by international agencies such as the United Nations.  In the final decade of the twentieth century, Jürgen Habermas' approach linked principles of toleration to the very nature of political argument: for us to have a political argument, we must agree to certain principles of fair argumentation. The difficultly here is that diversity is even more of a problem on the international scene, where discussions of human rights are essential. At the local or national level, the point of liberalism is that the neutral state ought not interfere or comment on the quality of individual lives unless the lives and actions of private individuals become a menace to the rights and privacy of other individuals. Internationally, Rawls follows Kant in specifying the Law of Peoples that is supposed to maintain order among diverse mutually tolerant nations.

A further complication arises at the level of group rights (both within national and international politics), where groups and their members claim the right to be tolerated by larger political organizations. Here the idea of tolerating the practices and identities of groups may paradoxically result in toleration for intolerant groups. This is the case for example, when tolerant governments consider groups who advocate violence, discrimination, and other intolerant practices. Such groups can be intolerant toward their own members, toward the tolerant liberal societies in which they subside, and indeed toward those international organizations who support toleration throughout the globe.

The risk of political liberalism is that it hovers uneasily between pluralism and relativism, while seeking to avoid metaphysical dogmatism or political imperialism. The basic pluralism of political liberalism supports political toleration by recognizing that conflicting comprehensive doctrines can each be justified as reasonable according to the standards internal to them. This leaves us with the conflicts of reasonable pluralism: each of the conflicting comprehensive doctrines is reasonable on its own terms and to the extent that it recognizes the reasonableness of other comprehensive doctrines. Thus, for Rawls, cooperation between reasonable comprehensive doctrines is a practical political task. The state should refrain from entering into a discussion of which comprehensive doctrine is better morally, epistemologically, or metaphysically quite simply because such a discussion would be unjust for a neutral state confronted with the fact of diversity. By defining his account of state neutrality as political, Rawls wants to distance his account of reasonable pluralism from a more robust form of philosophical skepticism. This is reminiscent of Locke's approach to epistemological toleration: since we cannot in practice force individuals to agree about moral or metaphysical truths, we should tolerate diversity at the political level.

Rawls does, however, hold that there is a best political arrangement, even if the truth about the best political arrangement is arrived at by way of pragmatic concerns for what works politically in light of the fact of diversity. And thus his idea of political consensus tries to avoid the slide toward skepticism and relativism. It seems that for political toleration, there is at least one non-relative value—that of toleration and peaceful coexistence—even if this is merely pragmatically justified by the concrete historical need for peaceful coexistence among those who cannot arrive at consensus about their views of the good.

The approach of political liberalism has appeared to succeed in practice. One could argue that the idea of the neutral state and of political consensus about the need for toleration has been gradually developing in Constitutional Law in the U.S. and in international law by way of the U.N.'s Declaration of Human Rights. Article 26 of the U.N. Declaration states explicitly that education is a universal right and that education should aim to "promote understanding, tolerance and friendship among all nations, racial or religious groups." We are still far from actualizing the idea of a tolerant international community. However, it is fairly clear that in the last several decades the idea of political toleration has succeeded in the United States and in other Western countries.

Despite this success, critics such as Michael Sandel, in his Democracy's Discontent (1998), have argued that the tolerant attitude of what he calls "the procedural republic" must be grounded in a more comprehensive moral theory. Without such a ground, Sandel worries that the tolerant neutral state will ultimately lose its connection with the moral lives of individuals. Sandel claims in his arguments against Rawls and against certain developments in Constitutional Law that the approach of political liberalism cannot ultimately take account of the depth of commitment that most individuals have to their own comprehensive doctrines. Rawls admits that for his idea of overlapping consensus to work, he must assume a weakening of private faith in comprehensive doctrines. The problem here is that it argues for toleration by underestimating the power of those forms of private faith that must be tolerated.

A further problem of the political approach to toleration is that it struggles to define the nature of privacy. Moral toleration claims that there are certain private activities which are only of concern to the individual and that the state would be unjustified in interfering with these private activities. A merely political approach to toleration is however unable to draw the line dividing public and private in a metaphysical fashion. Rather, the sphere of privacy is itself defined only as a result of the process of building political consensus. Thus the worry is that the principles of political liberalism are not clearly defined and that toleration, as a mere modus vivendi, could be violated if the political consensus were to shift. In other words, if there is no metaphysical basis for a sphere of privacy, then it is not exactly clear what the politically grounded idea of liberal toleration is supposed to tolerate.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Beiner, Ronald. What's the Matter with Liberalism (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1992).
  • Berlin, Isaiah. "Two Concepts of Liberty" in Four Essays on Liberty(Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1969).
  • Cook, John W. Morality and Cultural Differences (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999).
  • Dworkin, Ronald. Sovereign Virtue (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2000).
  • Dworkin, Ronald. Taking Rights Seriously (Cambridge: Harvard, 1977).
  • Fiala, Andrew. "Toleration and Pragmatism" in Journal of Speculative Philosophy, 16: 2, (2002), 103-116.
  • Habermas, Jürgen. Moral Consciousness and Communicative Action (Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, 1990).
  • Heyd, David, ed. Toleration: An Elusive Virtue (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1996).
  • Horton, John and Peter Nicholson, eds. Toleration: Philosophy and Practice (London: Ashgate Publishing, 1992).
  • King, Preston. Toleration (London: Frank Cass, 1998).
  • Kymlicka, Will. Liberalism, Community, and Culture (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1989).
  • Laursen, John Christian. "Spinoza on Toleration" in Difference and Dissent: Theories of Tolerance in Medieval and Early Modern Europe, edited by Nederman and Laursen (Lanham, Maryland: Rowman and Littlefield, 1996).
  • Locke, John. Letter Concerning Toleration in Steven M. Cahn ed. Classics of Modern Political Theory (New York: Oxford University Press, 1997).
  • Mara, Gerald M. "Socrates and Liberal Toleration" in Political Theory, 16:3 (1988).
  • Marcuse, Herbert. "Repressive Tolerance" in Wolff, Moore, and Marcuse, eds., A Critique of Pure Tolerance (Boston: Beacon Press, 1969).
  • Maritain, Jacques. Man and the State (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1951).
  • Mendus, Susan and David Edwards, eds. On Toleration (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1987).
  • Mendus, Susan. "Locke: Toleration, Morality, and Rationality" in John Horton and Susan Mendus, eds., John Locke: A Letter Concerning Toleration in Focus (London: Routledge, 1991).
  • Mendus, Susan. Toleration and the Limits of Liberalism (Atlantic Highlands, NJ: Humanities Press International, 1989).
  • Mill, John Stuart. On Liberty and Other Essays (Oxford: Oxford World Classics, 1998).
  • Milton, John. Aereopogatica in Encyclopedia Britannica's Great Books of the Western World, vol. 29 (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1991).
  • Newey, Glen. Virtue, Reason, and Toleration (Edinburgh: University of Edinburgh Press, 1999).
  • Oberdiek, Hans. Tolerance: Between Forbearance and Acceptance (Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2001).
  • Paine, Thomas. The Complete Writings of Thomas Paine ed. by Philip Foner (New York: The Citadel Press, 1945).
  • Popper, Karl. The Open Society and its Enemies (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1971).
  • Rawls, John. A Theory of Justice (Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1971).
  • Rawls, John. Justice as Fairness: A Restatement (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2001).
  • Rawls, John. Political Liberalism (New York: Columbia University Press, 1995).
  • Rawls, John. The Law of Peoples (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2001).
  • Razavi, Mehdi Amin and David Ambuel, eds. Philosophy, Religion, and the Question of Intolerance (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1997).
  • Ricoeur, Paul, ed. Tolerance Between Intolerance and the Intolerable (an edition of Diogenes, No. 176, Vol. 44/4, Winter 1996).
  • Rorty, Richard. Contingency, Irony, Solidarity (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989).
  • Rosenthal, Michael A. "Tolerance as a Virtue in Spinoza's Ethics" in Journal of the History of Philosophy 39:4 (2001), 535-557.
  • Sandel, Michael. Democracy's Discontent (Cambridge: Harvard, 1998).
  • Sandel, Michael. Liberalism and the Limits of Justice (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982).
  • Sen, Amartya. "Human Rights and Asian Values" in The New Republic 217: 2-3 (1997), 33-40.
  • Spinoza, Baruch. Theological-Political Treatise and Political Treatise (New York: Dover Publications, 1951).
  • Tan, Kok-Chor. Toleration, Diversity, and Global Justice (University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 2000).
  • Voltaire. Philosophical Dictionary (Cleveland: World Publishing Co., 1943).
  • Waldron, Jeremy. "Locke: Toleration and the Rationality of Persecution" in John Horton and Susan Mendus eds., John Locke: A Letter Concerning Toleration in Focus (London: Routledge, 1991).
  • Walzer, Michael. On Toleration (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1997).

Author Information

Andrew Fiala
University of Wisconsin — Green Bay
U. S. A.


The terms “objectivity” and “subjectivity,” in their modern usage, generally relate to a perceiving subject (normally a person) and a perceived or unperceived object. The object is something that presumably exists independent of the subject’s perception of it. In other words, the object would be there, as it is, even if no subject perceived it. Hence, objectivity is typically associated with ideas such as reality, truth and reliability.

The perceiving subject can either perceive accurately or seem to perceive features of the object that are not in the object. For example, a perceiving subject suffering from jaundice could seem to perceive an object as yellow when the object is not actually yellow. Hence, the term “subjective” typically indicates the possibility of error.

The potential for discrepancies between features of the subject’s perceptual impressions and the real qualities of the perceived object generates philosophical questions. There are also philosophical questions regarding the nature of objective reality and the nature of our so-called subjective reality. Consequently, we have various uses of the terms “objective” and “subjective” and their cognates to express possible differences between objective reality and subjective impressions. Philosophers refer to perceptual impressions themselves as being subjective or objective. Consequent judgments are objective or subjective to varying degrees, and we divide reality into objective reality and subjective reality. Thus, it is important to distinguish the various uses of the terms “objective” and “subjective.”

Table of Contents

  1. Terminology
  2. Epistemological Issues
    1. Can We Know Objective Reality?
    2. Does Agreement Among Subjects Indicate Objective Knowledge?
    3. Primary and Secondary Qualities: Can We Know Primary Qualities?
    4. Skepticism Regarding Knowledge of Objective Reality
    5. Defending Objective Knowledge
    6. Is There No Escape From the Subjective?
  3. Metaphysical Issues
  4. Objectivity in Ethics
    1. Persons in Contrast to Objects
    2. Objectivism, Subjectivism and Non-Cognitivism
    3. Objectivist Theories
    4. Can We Know Moral Facts?
  5. Major Historical Philosophical Theories of Objective Reality
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Terminology

Many philosophers would use the term “objective reality” to refer to anything that exists as it is independent of any conscious awareness of it (via perception, thought, etc.). Common mid-sized physical objects presumably apply, as do persons having subjective states. Subjective reality would then include anything depending upon some (broadly construed) conscious awareness of it to exist. Particular instances of colors and sounds (as they are perceived) are prime examples of things that exist only when there are appropriate conscious states. Particular instances of emotions (e.g., my present happiness) also seem to be a subjective reality, existing when one feels them, and ceasing to exist when one’s mood changes.

“Objective knowledge” can simply refer to knowledge of an objective reality. Subjective knowledge would then be knowledge of any subjective reality.

There are, however, other uses of the terminology related to objectivity. Many philosophers use the term “subjective knowledge” to refer only to knowledge of one’s own subjective states. Such knowledge is distinguished from one’s knowledge of another individual’s subjective states and from knowledge of objective reality, which would both be objective knowledge under the present definitions. Your knowledge of another person’s subjective states can be called objective knowledge since it is presumably part of the world that is “object” for you, just as you and your subjective states are part of the world that is “object” for the other person.

This is a prominent distinction in epistemology (the philosophical study of knowledge) because many philosophers have maintained that subjective knowledge in this sense has a special status. They assert, roughly, that knowledge of one’s own subjective states is direct, or immediate, in a way that knowledge of anything else is not. It is convenient to refer to knowledge of one’s own subjective states simply as subjective knowledge. Following this definition, objective knowledge would be knowledge of anything other than one’s own subjective states.

One last prominent style of usage for terms related to objectivity deals with the nature of support a particular knowledge-claim has. “Objective knowledge” can designate a knowledge-claim having, roughly, the status of being fully supported or proven. Correspondingly, “subjective knowledge” might designate some unsupported or weakly supported knowledge-claim. It is more accurate to refer to these as objective and subjective judgments, rather than knowledge, but one should be on guard for the use of the term “knowledge” in this context. This usage fits with the general connotation for the term “objectivity” of solidity, trustworthiness, accuracy, impartiality, etc. The general connotation for many uses of “subjectivity” includes unreliability, bias, an incomplete (personal) perspective, etc.

“Objective judgment or belief” refers to a judgment or belief based on objectively strong supporting evidence, the sort of evidence that would be compelling for any rational being. A subjective judgment would then seem to be a judgment or belief supported by evidence that is compelling for some rational beings (subjects) but not compelling for others. It could also refer to a judgment based on evidence that is of necessity available only to some subjects.

These are the main uses for the terminology within philosophical discussions. Let’s examine some of the main epistemological issues regarding objectivity, presuming the aforementioned definitions of “objective reality” and “subjective reality.”

2. Epistemological Issues

a. Can We Know Objective Reality?

The subjective is characterized primarily by perceiving mind. The objective is characterized primarily by physical extension in space and time. The simplest sort of discrepancy between subjective judgment and objective reality is well illustrated by John Locke’s example of holding one hand in ice water and the other hand in hot water for a few moments. When one places both hands into a bucket of tepid water, one experiences competing subjective experiences of one and the same objective reality. One hand feels it as cold, the other feels it as hot. Thus, one perceiving mind can hold side-by-side clearly differing impressions of a single object. From this experience, it seems to follow that two different perceiving minds could have clearly differing impressions of a single object. That is, two people could put their hands into the bucket of water, one describing it as cold, the other describing it as hot. Or, more plausibly, two people could step outside, one describing the weather as chilly, the other describing it as pleasant.

We confront, then, an epistemological challenge to explain whether, and if so how, some subjective impressions can lead to knowledge of objective reality. A skeptic can contend that our knowledge is limited to the realm of our own subjective impressions, allowing us no knowledge of objective reality as it is in itself.

b. Does Agreement Among Subjects Indicate Objective Knowledge?

Measurement is allegedly a means to reach objective judgments, judgments having at least a high probability of expressing truth regarding objective reality. An objective judgment regarding the weather, in contrast to the competing subjective descriptions, would describe it as, say, 20°C (68°F). This judgment results from use of a measuring device. It is unlikely that the two perceiving subjects, using functioning thermometers, would have differing judgments about the outside air.

The example of two people giving differing reports about the weather (e.g., “chilly” vs. “pleasant”) illustrates that variation in different subjects’ judgments is a possible indicator of the subjectivity of their judgments. Agreement in different subjects’ judgments (20°C) is often taken to be indicative of objectivity. Philosophers commonly call this form of agreement “intersubjective agreement.” Does intersubjective agreement prove that there is objective truth? No, because having two or three or more perceiving subjects agreeing, for example, that it is very cold does not preclude the possibility of another perceiving subject claiming that it is not at all cold. Would we have a high likelihood of objective truth if we had intersubjective agreement among a large number of subjects? This line of reasoning seems promising, except for another observation from Locke about the possible discrepancies between subjective impressions and objective reality.

c. Primary and Secondary Qualities: Can We Know Primary Qualities?

According to Locke’s distinction between primary and secondary qualities, some of our subjective impressions do not correspond to any objective reality in the thing perceived. Our perception of sound, for example, is nothing like the actual physical vibrations that we know are the real cause of our subjective experience. Our perception of color is nothing like the complex combinations of various frequencies of electromagnetic radiation that we know cause our perception of color. Locke asserts that we can, through science, come to know what primary characteristics the object has in itself. Science teaches us, he says, that sound as we perceive it is not in the object itself whereas spatial dimensions, mass, duration, motion, etc. are in the object itself.

In response to this point, one can assert that, through science, we discover that those subjective impressions corresponding to nothing in the object are nonetheless caused by the truly objective features of the object. Thus, Locke’s approach leads to optimism regarding objective knowledge, i.e., knowledge of how things are independent of our perceptions of them.

d. Skepticism Regarding Knowledge of Objective Reality

In response to Locke’s line of thinking, Immanuel Kant used the expression “Ding an sich” (the “thing-in-itself”) to designate pure objectivity. The Ding an sich is the object as it is in itself, independent of the features of any subjective perception of it. While Locke was optimistic about scientific knowledge of the true objective (primary) characteristics of things, Kant, influenced by skeptical arguments from David Hume, asserted that we can know nothing regarding the true nature of the Ding an sich, other than that it exists. Scientific knowledge, according to Kant, is systematic knowledge of the nature of things as they appear to us subjects rather than as they are in themselves.

Using Kant’s distinction, intersubjective agreement would seem to be not only the best evidence we can have of objective truth but constitutive of objective truth itself. (This might require a theoretically perfect intersubjective agreement under ideal conditions.) Starting from the assumption that we can have knowledge only of things as they appear in subjective experience, the only plausible sense for the term “objective” would be judgments for which there is universal intersubjective agreement, or just for which there is necessarily universal agreement. If, alternately, we decide to restrict the term “objective” to the Ding an sich, there would be, according to Kant, no objective knowledge. The notion of objectivity thus becomes useless, perhaps even meaningless (for, say, a verificationist).

Facing any brand of skepticism regarding knowledge of objective reality in any robust sense, we should note that the notion of there being an objective reality is independent of any particular assertion about our prospects for knowing that reality in any objective sense. One should, in other words, agree that the idea of some objective reality, existing as it is independent of any subjective perception of it, apparently makes sense even for one who holds little hope for any of us knowing that there is such a reality, or knowing anything objectively about such a reality. Perhaps our human situation is such that we cannot know anything beyond our experiences; perhaps we are, each one of us individually, confined to the theater of our own minds. Nonetheless, we can conceive what it means to assert an objective reality beyond the stream of our experiences.

e. Defending Objective Knowledge

Opposing skepticism regarding objective reality, it is conceivable that there are “markers” of some sort in our subjective experiences distinguishing the reliable perceptions of objective truth from the illusions generated purely subjectively (hallucinations, misperceptions, perceptions of secondary qualities, etc.). Descartes, for example, wrote of “clear and distinct impressions” as having an inherent mark, as it were, attesting to their reliability as indicators of how things are objectively. This idea does not have many defenders today, however, since Descartes asserted certainty for knowledge derived from clear and distinct ideas. More acceptable among philosophers today would be a more modest assertion of a high likelihood of reliability for subjective impressions bearing certain marks. The marks of reliable impressions are not “clear and distinct” in Descartes’ sense, but have some connection to common sense ideas about optimal perceptual circumstances. Thus, defenders of objective knowledge are well advised to search for subjectively accessible “marks” on impressions that indicate a high likelihood of truth.

A defender of the prospects for objective knowledge would apparently want also to give some significance to intersubjective agreement. Assertions of intersubjective agreement are based, of course, on one’s subjective impressions of other perceiving subjects agreeing with one’s own judgments. Thus, intersubjective agreement is just one type of “mark” one might use to identify the more likely reliable impressions. This is simple common-sense. We have much more confidence in our judgments (or should, anyway) when they are shared by virtually everyone with whom we discuss them than when others (showing every sign of normal perceptual abilities and a sane mind) disagree. A central assumption behind this common pattern of thought, however, is that there are indeed many other perceiving subjects besides ourselves and we are all capable, sometimes at least, of knowing objective reality. Another assumption is that objective reality is logically consistent. Assuming that reality is consistent, it follows that your and my logically incompatible judgments about a thing cannot both be true; intersubjective disagreement indicates error for at least one of us. One can also argue that agreement indicates probable truth, because it is unlikely that you and I would both be wrong in our judgment regarding an object and both be wrong in exactly the same way. Conversely, if we were both wrong about some object, it is likely that we would have differing incorrect judgments about it, since there are innumerable ways for us to make a wrong judgment about an object.

f. Is There No Escape From the Subjective?

Despite plausible ways of arguing that intersubjective disagreement indicates error and agreement indicates some probability of truth, defenses of objective knowledge all face the philosophically daunting challenge of providing a cogent argument showing that any purported “mark” of reliability (including apparent intersubjective agreement) actually does confer a high likelihood of truth. The task seems to presuppose some method of determining objective truth in the very process of establishing certain sorts of subjective impressions as reliable indicators of truth. That is, we require some independent (non-subjective) way of determining which subjective impressions support knowledge of objective reality before we can find subjectively accessible “markers” of the reliable subjective impressions. What could such a method be, since every method of knowledge, judgment, or even thought seems quite clearly to go on within the realm of subjective impressions? One cannot get out of one’s subjective impressions, it seems, to test them for reliability. The prospects for knowledge of the objective world are hampered by our essential confinement within subjective impressions.

3. Metaphysical Issues

In metaphysics, i.e., the philosophical study of the nature of reality, the topic of objectivity brings up philosophical puzzles regarding the nature of the self, for a perceiving subject is also, according to most metaphysical theories, a potential object of someone else’s perceptions. Further, one can perceive oneself as an object, in addition to knowing one’s subjective states fairly directly. The self, then, is known both as subject and as object. Knowledge of self as subject seems to differ significantly from knowledge of the self as object.

The differences are most markedly in evidence in the philosophy of mind. Philosophers of mind try to reconcile, in some sense, what we know about the mind objectively and what we know subjectively. Observing minded beings as objects is central to the methods of psychology, sociology, and the sciences of the brain. Observing one minded being from the subjective point of view is something we all do, and it is central to our ordinary notions of the nature of mind. A fundamental problem for the philosophy of mind is to explain how any object, no matter how complex, can give rise to mind as we know it from the subjective point of view. That is, how can mere “stuff” give rise to the rich complexity of consciousness as we experience it? It seems quite conceivable that there be creatures exactly like us, when seen as objects, but having nothing like our conscious sense of ourselves as subjects. So there is the question of why we do have subjective conscious experience and how that comes to be. Philosophers also struggle to explain what sort of relationship might obtain between mind as we see it embodied objectively and mind as we experience it subjectively. Are there cause-and-effect relationships, for example, and how do they work?

The topic of seeing others and even oneself as an object in the objective world is a metaphysical issue, but it brings up an ethical issue regarding the treatment of persons. There are, in addition, special philosophical issues regarding assertions of objectivity in ethics.

4. Objectivity in Ethics

a. Persons in Contrast to Objects

First, the dual nature of persons as both subjects (having subjective experience) and objects within objective reality relates to one of the paramount theories of ethics in the history of philosophy. Immanuel Kant’s ethics gives a place of central importance to respect for persons. One formulation of his highly influential Categorical Imperative relates to the dual nature of persons. This version demands that one “treat humanity, in your own person or in the person of any other, never simply as a means, but always at the same time as an end” (Groundwork, p. 96). One may treat a mere object simply as a means to an end; one may use a piece of wood, for example, simply as a means of repairing a fence. A person, by contrast, is marked by subjectivity, having a subjective point of view, and has a special moral status according to Kant. Every person must be regarded as an end, that is as having intrinsic value. It seems that the inherent value of a person depends essentially on the fact that a person has a subjective conscious life in addition to objective existence.

This ethical distinction brings out an aspect of the term “object” as a “mere object,” in contrast to the subjectivity of a person. The term “objectivity” in this context can signify the mere “object-ness” of something at its moral status.

Despite widespread agreement that being a person with a subjective point of view has a special moral status, there is a general difficulty explaining whether this alleged fact, like all alleged moral facts, is an objective fact in any sense. It is also difficult to explain how one can know moral truths if they are indeed objective.

b. Objectivism, Subjectivism and Non-Cognitivism

Philosophical theories about the nature of morality generally divide into assertions that moral truths express subjective states and assertions that moral truths express objective facts, analogous to the fact, for example, that the sun is more massive than the earth.

So-called subjectivist theories regard moral statements as declaring that certain facts hold, but the facts expressed are facts about a person’s subjective states. For example, the statement “It is wrong to ignore a person in distress if you are able to offer aid” just means something like “I find it offensive when someone ignores a person in distress….” This is a statement about the subject’s perceptions of the object, not about the object itself (that is, ignoring a person in distress). Objectivist theories, in contrast, regard the statement “It is wrong to ignore….” as stating a fact about the ignoring itself.

Subjectivist theories do not have to regard moral statements as statements about a single subject’s perceptions or feelings. A subjectivist could regard the statement “Torture is immoral,” for example, as merely expressing the feeling of abhorrence among members of a certain culture, or among people in general.

In addition to objectivism and subjectivism, a third major theory of morality called non-cognitivism asserts that alleged moral statements do not make any claim about any reality, either subjective or objective. This approach asserts that alleged moral statements are just expressions of subjective feelings; they are not reports about such feelings. Thus the statement “Torture is immoral” is equivalent to wincing or saying “ugh” at the thought of torture, rather than describing your feelings about torture.

c. Objectivist Theories

Among objectivist theories of morality, the most straightforward version declares that is it an objective fact, for example, that it is wrong to ignore a person in distress if you are able to offer aid. This sort of theory asserts that the wrongness of such behavior is part of objective reality in the same way that the sun’s being more massive than the earth is part of objective reality. Both facts would obtain regardless of whether any conscious being ever came to know either of them.

Other objectivist theories of morality try to explain the widespread feeling that there is an important difference between moral assertions and descriptive, factual assertions while maintaining that both types of assertion are about something other than mere subjective states. Such theories compare moral assertions to assertions about secondary qualities. The declaration that a certain object is green is not merely a statement about a person’s subjective state. It makes an assertion about how the object is, but it’s an assertion that can be formulated only in relation to the states of perceiving subjects under the right conditions. Thus, determining whether an object is green depends essentially on consulting the considered judgments of appropriately placed perceivers. Being green, by definition, implies the capacity to affect perceiving humans under the right conditions in certain ways. By analogy, moral assertions can be assertions about how things objectively are while depending essentially on consulting the considered judgments of appropriately placed perceivers. Being morally wrong implies, on this view, the capacity to affect perceiving humans under the right conditions in certain ways.

d. Can We Know Moral Facts?

For either sort of objectivist approach to morality, it is difficult to explain how people come to know the moral properties of things. We seem not to be able to know the moral qualities of things through ordinary sense experience, for example, because the five senses seem only to tell us how things are in the world, not how they ought to be. Nor can we reason from the way things are to the way they ought to be, since, as David Hume noted, “is” does not logically imply an “ought.” Some philosophers, including Hume, have postulated that we have a special mode of moral perception, analogous to but beyond the five ordinary senses, which gives us knowledge of moral facts. This proposal is controversial, since it presents problems for verifying moral perceptions and resolving moral disputes. It is also problematic as long as it provides no account of how moral perception works. By contrast, we have a good understanding of the mechanisms underlying our perception of secondary qualities such as greenness.

Many people assert that it is much less common to get widespread agreement on moral judgments than on matters of observable, measurable facts. Such an assertion seems to be an attempt to argue that moral judgments are not objective based on lack of intersubjective agreement about them. Widespread disagreement does not, however, indicate that there is no objective fact to be known. There are many examples of widespread disagreement regarding facts that are clearly objective. For example, there was once widespread disagreement about whether the universe is expanding or in a “steady state.” That disagreement did not indicate that there is no objective fact concerning the state of the universe. Thus, widespread disagreement regarding moral judgments would not, by itself, indicate that there are no objective moral facts.

This assertion is apparently an attempt to modify the inference from widespread intersubjective agreement to objective truth. If so, it is mistaken. Assuming that the inference from intersubjective agreement to probable objective truth is strong, it does not follow that one can infer from lack of intersubjective agreement to probable subjectivity. As previously indicated, intersubjective disagreement logically supports the assertion that there is an error in at least one of the conflicting judgments, but it does not support an assertion of the mere subjectivity of the matter being judged. Further, the vast areas of near-universal agreement in moral judgments typically receives too little attention in discussions of the nature of morality. There are seemingly innumerable moral judgments (e.g., it is wrong to needlessly inflict pain on a newborn baby) that enjoy nearly universal agreement across cultures and across time periods. This agreement should, at least prima facie, support an assertion to objectivity as it does for, say, judgments about the temperature outside.

5. Major Historical Philosophical Theories of Objective Reality

Any serious study of the nature of objectivity and objective knowledge should examine the central metaphysical and epistemological positions of history’s leading philosophers, as well as contemporary contributions. The following very brief survey should give readers some idea of where to get started.

Plato is famous for a distinctive view of objective reality. He asserted roughly that the greatest reality was not in the ordinary physical objects we sense around us, but in what he calls Forms, or Ideas. (The Greek term Plato uses resembles the word “idea,” but it is preferable to call them Forms, for they are not ideas that exist only in a mind, as is suggested in our modern usage of the term “idea.”) Ordinary objects of our sense experience are real, but the Forms are a “higher reality,” according to Plato. Having the greatest reality, they are the only truly objective reality, we could say.

Forms are most simply described as the pure essences of things, or the defining characteristics of things. We see many varied instances of chairs around us, but the essence of what it is to be a chair is the Form “chair.” Likewise, we see many beautiful things around us, but the Form “beauty” is the “what it is to be beautiful.” The Form is simply whatever it is that sets beautiful things apart from everything else.

In epistemology, Plato accordingly distinguishes the highest knowledge as knowledge of the highest reality, the Forms. Our modern usage of the terms “objective knowledge” and “objective reality” seem to fit in reasonably well here.

Aristotle, by contrast, identifies the ordinary objects of sense experience as the most objective reality. He calls them “primary substance.” The forms of things he calls “secondary substance.” Hence, Aristotle’s metaphysics seems to fit better than Plato’s with our current understanding of objective reality, but his view of objective knowledge differs somewhat. For him, objective knowledge is knowledge of the forms, or essences, of things. We can know individual things objectively, but not perfectly. We can know individuals only during occurrent perceptual contact with them, but we can know forms perfectly, or timelessly.

Descartes famously emphasized that subjective reality is better known than objective reality, but knowledge of the objective reality of one’s own existence as a non-physical thinking thing is nearly as basic, or perhaps as basic, as one’s knowledge of the subjective reality of one’s own thinking. For Descartes, knowledge seems to start with immediate, indubitable knowledge of one’s subjective states and proceeds to knowledge of one’s objective existence as a thinking thing. Cogito, ergo sum (usually translated as “I think, therefore I am”) expresses this knowledge. All knowledge of realities other than oneself ultimately rests on this immediate knowledge of one’s own existence as a thinking thing. One’s existence as a non-physical thinking thing is an objective existence, but it appears that Descartes infers this existence from the subjective reality of his own thinking. The exact interpretation of his famous saying is still a matter of some controversy, however, and it may not express an inference at all.

We have already looked at some of John Locke’s most influential assertions about the nature of objective reality. Bishop Berkeley followed Locke’s empiricism in epistemology, but put forth a markedly different view of reality. Berkeley’s Idealism asserts that the only realities are minds and mental contents. He does, however, have a concept of objective reality. A table, for example, exists objectively in the mind of God. God creates objective reality by thinking it and sustains any objective reality, such as the table, only so long as he continues to think of it. Thus the table exists objectively for us, not just as a fleeting perception, but as the totality of all possible experiences of it. My particular experience of it at this moment is a subjective reality, but the table as an objective reality in the mind of God implies a totality of all possible experiences of it. Berkeley asserts there is no need to postulate some physical substance underlying all those experiences to be the objective reality of the table; the totality of possible experiences is adequate.

We have looked briefly at some of Kant’s claims about the nature of objective reality. More recent philosophy continues these discussions in many directions, some denying objectivity altogether. Detailed discussion of these movements goes beyond the purview of this essay, but interested readers should specially investigate Hegel’s idealism, as well as succeeding schools of thought such as phenomenology, existentialism, logical positivism, pragmatism, deconstructionism, and post-modernism. The philosophy of mind, naturally, also continually confronts basic questions of subjectivity and objectivity.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Alston, William P. “Yes, Virginia, There is a Real World.” Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association 52 (1979): 779-808.
  • Descartes, Rene. Meditations (1641). In The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, eds. J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff and D. Murdoch (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1975).
  • Kant, Immanuel. Prolegomena to any Future Metaphysics (1783). Trans. James W. Ellington (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1977).
  • Locke, John. Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1689). Ed. Peter Nidditch (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975).
  • Moser, Paul. Philosophy After Objectivity. (New York: Oxford University Press, 1993).
  • Nagel, Thomas. The View From Nowhere. (New York: Oxford University Press, 1986).
  • Quine, W. V. Word and Object. (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1960).
  • Rorty, Richard. Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature. (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1979).
  • Rorty, Richard. Objectivity, Relativism, and Truth: Philosophical Papers, Vol. 1. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991).
  • Wright, Crispin. Realism, Meaning, and Truth. (Oxford: Blackwell, 1987).

Author Information

Dwayne H. Mulder
Sonoma State University
U. S. A.


Voluntarism is the theory that God or the ultimate nature of reality is to be conceived as some form of will (or conation). This theory is contrasted to intellectualism, which gives primacy to God's reason. The voluntarism/intellectualism distinction was intimately tied to medieval and modern theories of natural law; if we grant that moral or physical laws issue from God, it next needs to be answered whether they issue from God's will or God's reason. In medieval philosophy, voluntarism was championed by Avicebron, Duns Scotus, and William of Ockham. Intellectualism, on the other hand, is found in Averroes, Aquinas, and Eckhart. The opposing theories were applied to the human psychology, the nature of God, ethics, and the heaven. According to intellectualism, choices of the will result from that which the intellect recognizes as good; the will itself is determined. For voluntarism, by contrast, it is the will which determines which objects are good, and the will itself is indetermined. Concerning the nature of heaven, intellectualists followed Aristotle's lead by seeing the final state of happiness as a state of contemplation. Voluntarism, by contrast, maintains that final happiness is an activity, specifically that of love. The conceptions of theology itself were polarized between these two views. According to intellectualism, theology should be an essentiall speculative science; according to voluntarism, it is a practical science aimed at controlling life, but not necessarily aimed at comprehending philosophic truth.In the modern period Spinoza advocates intellectualism insofar as desire is an indication of imperfection, and the passions are a source of human bondage. When all things are seen purely in rational relations, desire is stilled, the mind is freed from the passions and we experience the intellectual love of God, which is the ideal happiness. According to Leibniz, Spinoza's interpretation of the world as rational and logical left no place for the individual, or for the conception of ends or purposes as a determining factor in reality. Voluntarism is seen in Leibniz's view of the laws which govern monads (individual units of which all reality is composed) in so far as they are the laws of the conscious realization of ends.

19th century voluntarism has its origin in Kant, particularly his doctrine of the "primacy of the practical over the pure reason." Intellectually, humans are incapable of knowing ultimate reality, but this need not and must not interfere with the duty of acting as though the spiritual character of this reality were certain. Freedom cannot be demonstrated speculatively, but whenever a person acts under a motive supplied by reason, he is thereby exhibiting the practical efficiency of reason, and thus showing its reality in a practical sense. Following Kant, two distinct lines of voluntarism have proceeded which may be called rational and irrational voluntarism respectively. For Fichte, the originator of rational voluntarism, the ethical is primary both in the sphere of conduct and in the sphere of knowledge. The whole nature of consciousness can be understood only from the point of view of ends which are set up by the self. The actual world, with all the activity that it has, is only to be understood as material for the activity of the practical reason, as the means through which the will achieves complete freedom and complete moral realization. Schopenhauer's irrational voluntarism asserts a more radical opposition between the will and intellect. For him, the will is by its very nature irrational. It manifests itself in various stages in the world of nature as physical, chemical, magnetic, and vital force, pre-eminently, however, in the animal kingdom in the form of "the will to live," which means the tendency to assert itself in the struggle for means of existence and for reproduction of the species. This activity is all of it blind, so far as the individual agent is concerned, although the power and existence of the will are thereby asserted continually.

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