Category Archives: Philosophy of Law

Legal Validity

Legal validity governs the enforceability of law, and the standard of legal validity enhances or restricts the ability of the political ruler to enforce his will through legal coercion. Western law adopts three competing standards of legal validity. Each standard emphasizes a different dimension of law (Berman 1988, p. 779), and each has its own school of jurisprudence.

Legal positivism emphasizes law's political dimension. Legal positivism recognizes political rulers as the only source of valid law and adopts the will of the political ruler as its validity standard. Leading legal positivists include Jeremy Bentham, John Austin, and H.L.A. Hart.

Natural law theory emphasizes law's moral dimension. Natural law theory recognizes universal moral principles as the primary source of valid law. These moral principles provide a standard of legal validity that imposes moral limits on the ruler's coercive powers. Leading natural law theorists include Aristotle, Cicero, Justinian, and Thomas Aquinas.

The historicist school emphasizes law's historical dimension. The historicist school recognizes legal custom as the primary source of valid law. Legal custom provides a standard of legal validity that imposes customary limits on the political ruler's coercive powers. Leading historicists include Sir Edward Coke, John Selden, Sir Matthew Hale, and Sir William Blackstone.

Legal positivism recognizes positive law as the only real law and rejects law's moral and historical dimensions as sources of valid laws. Natural law theory and the historicist school, on the other hand, often integrate law's three dimensions. They recognize each dimension as a potential source of valid law but emphasize a particular dimension through their validity standard. Blackstone's unique jurisprudence adopts two validity standards, one from law's historical dimension, and one from law's moral dimension.

Standards of legal validity are historically cyclical. A society typically adopts a standard of legal validity based on moral principles, custom, or both. This validity standard restricts the ruler's ability to enforce his will through legal coercion. Then, intellectual challenges to moral principles and legal custom minimize their esteem. A new validity standard is adopted based on the will of the political ruler. Abuses of coercive powers by political rulers eventually stimulate renewed restrictions on those powers. The society adopts a revived standard of legal validity based on moral principles, custom, or both. The revived validity standard will typically endure until the memory of abuse fades, when the cycle begins again.

This cycle began with Hesiod in 700 B. C. E. and continued into the 21st Century. In common law jurisprudence, judicial acceptance of Hart's legal positivism eroded Blackstone's validity standards based on moral principles and custom. In civil law jurisprudence, Soviet and Nazi abuses of positivist legal systems revived validity standards based on moral principles. This essay describes the cycle of legal validity in Western law and proposes a fresh approach to legal validity to break this cycle.

Table of Contents

  1. The Sophists
  2. Plato
  3. Aristotle
  4. Cicero
  5. Justinian's Corpus Juris Civilis
  6. Aquinas
  7. Blackstone
  8. Bentham
  9. Austin
  10. Hart
  11. Radbruch
  12. Positivism in American Jurisprudence
  13. A Fresh Approach
  14. References and Further Reading

1. The Sophists

The first standard of legal validity in the Western legal tradition appears in Hesiod's religious poem Works and Days, circa 700 B. C. E. Hesiod presents an archetypal jurisprudence that integrates law's three dimensions. Dikê, the goddess of human justice, personifies law's moral dimension. Dikê's father Zeus personifies law's political dimension. Dikê's mother Thetis, the Titan embodiment of custom and social order, personifies law's historical dimension.

Justice "sets the laws straight with righteousness" and distinguishes men from beasts. Divinely decreed moral principles establish the validity standard for human law and customs, and conforming laws and customs establish the nomoi (law). Just men obey the nomoi, and obedience brings peace and prosperity. Disobedience brings punishment to the individual and his city through famine, plague, infertility, and military disaster.

The Sophists, wandering teachers of the fifth century B. C. E., challenged Greek conventions in religion, morality, and political conduct. They rejected Hesiod's moral dimension by rejecting the existence of divine lawgivers and universal moral principles. They rejected Hesiod's historical dimension by denying any normative authority to custom. Might was right, and law functioned only in the political dimension as the will of the strongest.

The Sophist Protagoras of Abdera (b. circa 481 B. C. E.), rejected law's moral dimension. As an agnostic, Protagoras rejected the divine lawgiver. As a moral relativist, Protagoras rejected the existence of universal moral principles. Unlike later Sophists, however, Protagoras accepted the validity of custom in law's historical dimension.

Protagoras based his moral relativism on the argument that a shared factual knowledge of the world is impossible. The foundation of Protagoras' relativism is the "man-measure" of the Aletheia (Truth). "Man is the measure of all things, of those that are that they are, of those that are not that they are not."

Sense perception forms the basis of all knowledge, Protagoras believed, and every sense impression that a person receives is securely true. The data of sense perception, however, are private, subjective states. The wind is truly warm to the man who perceives it as warm, but the same wind is truly cold to the man who perceives it as cold. Perceived objects therefore have contradictory properties and there are no public facts.

Protagoras maintained that all knowledge claims are thus equally true. Furthermore, their truth endures regardless of conflicting claims. Protagoras therefore claimed "it is equally possible to affirm and deny anything of anything." (Aristotle, Metaphysics, 1007b).

Protagoras extended his doctrine that all knowledge claims are equally true to claim that all virtue claims are equally true. Virtue claims are relative to the claimant because virtue is only another form of knowledge. (Plato, Protagoras, 323a-328d). There are no universal moral principles, and law's moral dimension does not exist.

Although Protagoras rejected law's moral dimension, he embraced law's historical dimension. Although all knowledge and virtue claims are equally true, Protagoras argued they are not all equally sound. Only the ignorant equated truth with soundness. One set of thoughts can therefore be "better than another, but not in any way truer." The same is true of laws. All laws are equally true, but not all laws are equally sound.

Protagoras accepted a duty to obey the law. Since no moral or legal code is truer than any other, no individual should assert his moral or legal judgments over those advanced by the state. Society is required to preserve humanity. The perpetuation of society, in turn, requires respect for law and custom. Men should obey the state's laws and customs so long as they function soundly. (Plato, Protagoras, 322d; Theaetetus, 167b).

The Sophist Callicles (b. circa 484 B. C. E.), rejected law's historical dimension and denied any duty to obey the law. Using "nature" to mean the antithesis of mind, Callicles argued that nature's normative authority (phusis) supersedes the normative authority of man's laws and customs (nomoi). Man's laws and customs violate "nature's own law" and "natural justice." Nature's law, not man's, should govern our actions.

Callicles said that what men call "right" merely expresses what men believe to be to their advantage. Legal conventions in democracies wrongfully elevate the weak over the strong. The majority of weaker folk frame the laws for their advantage to prevent the stronger from gaining advantage over them. The true nature of right is established by nature, not men, and nature's law establishes right in the strong. Natural justice provides that the better and wiser man should rule over and have more than the inferior. Might, therefore, makes right. All animals and races of man recognize right as the sovereignty and advantage of the stronger over the weaker. (Plato, Gorgias, 483b-d, 490a).

The Sophist Thrasymachus (b. circa 459 B. C. E.) argued for disobeying laws and customs. Defining justice as obedience to the laws, Thrasymachus argues that justice is nothing but the advantage of the stronger. Obedience furthers the advantage of others and reduces the obedient to a form of slavery. Only disobedience to law profits a man and leads to his advantage. Injustice is therefore "a stronger, freer, and more masterful thing than justice." (Plato, Republic, 338c-344c).

Solon's constitution created an archetypal positivist legal system in Athens in 594 B. C. E. Solon reposed political and judicial authority in the heliastic courts. The courts enforced undefined laws with no standard of legal validity other than the unrestrained will of the jurors. Pericles' introduction of payments for jurors in 451 B. C. E. enthroned Athens' poorest and least educated class as dikasts in the heliastic courts. The Athenian courts became infamous for injustice and gullibility. Xenophon writes that Athenian courts often acted on emotion to put innocent men to death and acquit wrongdoers. (Xenophon 1990, pp.41-42). Eighty dikasts who found Socrates innocent voted for his death.

Athenian ostracism (ostrakismos) permitted the conviction, exile, and execution of any Athenian without charges, hearing, or defense. Originally intended for removing tyrants, Plutarch records that ostracism quickly became a way of pacifying jealousy of the eminent. Ostracism breathed out malice in exile and death. Every one was liable to it whose reputation, birth, or eloquence rose above the common level. (Plutarch 1914, pp. 2, 230, 233).

Athens ostracized its greatest heroes from envy of their honors. Athens ostracized Aristides, the hero of the Battle of Marathon, in 483 B. C. E. Athens ostracized Themistocles, savior of Athens at the Battle of Salamis, in 471 B. C. E. Both men were exiled for ten years without charges or a hearing.

Lack of procedural safeguards encouraged frivolous public prosecutions (graphai) and impeachments (eisangeliai), giving free reign to Athens' gullible and imprudent dikasts. Frivolous political prosecutions destroyed Athens' leadership, spawning bloody regime changes and military disasters. The frivolous prosecution of Pericles in 443 B. C. E. precipitated the Peloponnesian War with Sparta. The frivolous prosecution of Alcibiades in 415 B. C. E. caused Athens' ablest general to switch sides and lead Sparta against Athens.

The greatest ignominy involves the Arginusae generals in 404 B. C. E. Six Athenian naval commanders won a great naval victory against Sparta at Arginusae. A violent storm prevented their recovering the dead and shipwrecked. The generals were nevertheless impeached and executed for failing to do so. Deprived of her best generals, Athens lost the war the next year in a devastating naval defeat at Aegospotami.

Political prosecutions wreaked political havoc as well. Five regime changes rocked Athens between 411 B. C. E. and 403 B. C. E. These regimes included the reign of terror by the Thirty Tyrants in 404 B. C. E.

Athenian positivism criminalized thought and expression in frivolous prosecutions against philosophers. Anaxagoras circa 430 B. C. E., Protagoras circa 415 B. C. E., and Socrates in 399 B. C. E. were all convicted on manufactured charges of impiety (asebeia). Impiety was undefined by Athenian law. Every juror defined it anew in every case as he pleased.

Athens often regretted its decisions. Socrates' lead accuser Anytus was stoned for his role in Socrates' death. Athens honored Socrates with a bronze statue by Lysippus. Athens thus gained “the indelible reproach of decreeing to the same citizens the hemlock on one day and statues on the next.” (Hamilton 2010, p. 289).

2. Plato

Plato described Socrates as the bravest, wisest, and most upright man of his time. Plato planned a career in politics but "withdrew in disgust" after observing how Athenian courts "corrupted the written laws and customs." (Plato, Letter VII, 325a-c). Plato reacted to Socrates' death by repudiating the Sophists, reviving law's moral and historical dimensions, and formulating a natural law standard of legal validity based on principles of universal justice.

Plato begins his revival of law's historical dimension by emphasizing the autonomy of law, which he considered the most important aspect of government. Autonomous laws wield supremacy over political rulers. Political rulers are subject to the same laws as other citizens, and they may not alter the laws to suit their will.

Plato wrote that the preservation or ruin of a community depends on the autonomy of laws more than anything else. Respecting law's autonomy preserves the entire community. Disregarding it brings destruction. Autonomy is so important that "the man who is most perfect in obedience to established law" should receive the highest post in government. The second most obedient man should receive the second highest post, and so on for all the posts. (Plato, Laws, 715c-d.)

Plato begins his revival of law's moral dimension by persuasively refuting Protagoras' moral relativism in the Theaetetus. Protagoras claimed that all sense perceptions are equally true. Since knowledge is perception, all knowledge claims are equally true. Since moral claims are a species of knowledge claims, all moral claims are equally true. Therefore, no one set of moral principles has authority to guide the laws.

Plato offers eleven objections to Protagoras' arguments in the Theaetetus. Three are recounted here. First, Plato denies that knowledge is perception. If knowledge were perception, we would understand anyone speaking to us in a foreign tongue. This is clearly not the case. Second, remembered knowledge refutes Protagoras' claim that knowledge is perception. Remembered knowledge involves no perception, but it is knowledge nonetheless.

Third, moral relativism is self-refuting. Assume, as Protagoras claims, that "all beliefs are true." Assume also that another man exists who believes that "not all beliefs are true." If Protagoras is correct, then the second man's belief must be true. Protagoras' belief that "all beliefs are true" is thus refuted. (Plato, Theaetetus, 160e-177b).

Plato continues his revival of law's moral and historical dimensions in the Crito. The Crito considers whether a duty exists to obey the law. Socrates' friend Crito argues for Socrates to escape and avoid his unjust execution.

Socrates replies that the soul is more precious than the body. Good actions benefit our souls, but wrong actions mutilate them. The important thing is not living, but living well. This means living honorably. Socrates utilizes three principles in determining whether to escape. First, circumstances never justify wrong action. Second, one should not injure others, even when they injure you. Third, one "ought to honor one's agreements, provided they are right." (Plato, Crito, 47e-49e).

Plato defines law's moral dimension through these principles. Justinian's Corpus Juris Civilis defines its moral dimension by these same principles in the sixth century. (Justinian, Digest, 1.1.10). Blackstone's Commentaries does the same in the eighteenth century. (Blackstone 1828, p. 27).

Plato next refutes Thrasymachus' claim in the Republic that disobeying the law "is a stronger, freer, and more masterful thing" than obeying the law. In the Crito's "Speech of the Laws," the Laws present two arguments for obedience. The first is the "argument from agreement." Socrates has undertaken to live his life in obedience to Athens' laws. Athens did not force Socrates to live in its precincts. Socrates was free to leave at any time. By choosing to stay in Athens with full knowledge of how the laws functioned, Socrates promised obedience to the laws.

The Laws' orders are "in the form of proposals, not savage commands." Socrates can either obey the Laws or persuade (the personification of) the Law that they are at fault. If Socrates escapes without persuading the personification of the Laws that they were at fault, he would dishonor his agreement to obey the laws. Dishonoring a just agreement violates the ethic of "living well" and damages the soul.

The Laws' second argument is the "argument from injury." Disobedience destroys both the Laws and the city, which cannot exist if legal judgments are ignored. Socrates concludes that "both in war and in the law courts and everywhere else you must do whatever your city and your country command, or else persuade them in accordance with universal justice" that they are at fault.

The Laws' second argument implies a natural law standard of validity based on principles of universal justice. The Laws insist they operate as "proposals, not savage commands." Socrates' duty to obey the Laws is contingent on the Laws' compliance with principles of universal justice. By implication, there is no duty to obey the Laws if they violate principles of universal justice. (Plato, Crito, 51e-52d).

3. Aristotle

Aristotle designs his legal philosophy to avoid the catastrophes described in his Athenian Constitution. Aristotle accepts the necessity of law's political dimension because laws cannot enforce themselves. Nevertheless, the Athenian legal history proves the political dimension is not sufficient to preserve a society or achieve its happiness.

Human nature demands more than political power from law. Law must accomplish justice and foster virtue. Justice is required to prevent revolution, and virtue is required for human happiness. Man separated from justice is "the worst of animals," and man without virtue "is the most unholy and the most savage of animals." (Aristotle, Politics 1253a).

Aristotle writes in the Politics that securing justice is the state's most important function. Justice is more essential to the state than providing the necessities of life. Governments must be founded on justice to endure. Governments that rule unjustly and give unequal treatment to similarly placed subjects provoke revolutions. Justice maintained, however, forms a bond between the members of society that preserves the state. (Aristotle, Politics 1328b, 1332b, 1253a).

Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics defines justice as lawfulness concerned with the common advantage and happiness of the political community. Aristotle distinguishes between legal justice (to nomikon dikaion) and natural justice (physikon dikaion). Legal justice involves positive laws and custom enacted by man, such as conventional measures for grain and wine. These “are just not by nature but by human enactment” and “are not everywhere the same.”Aristotle secures legal justice by granting autonomy to law and by utilizing custom to encourage obedience. (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, 1134b-1135a).

Natural justice, on the other hand, involves principles of natural law that originate in nature. Such principles do not arise in the minds of men “by people’s thinking this or that.” Natural law principles apply with equal force everywhere, just as fire burns both in Greece and in Persia. Aristotle secures natural justice by adopting natural law precepts as the standard of legal validity. Positive laws that violate natural law precepts are nullified. (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, 1134b).

Aristotle secures legal justice by restricting the will of the political ruler through autonomous laws. The Politics teaches that unrestrained power produces tyranny, even in democracies. Aristotle considers whether societies function best under the "rule of men" or the "rule of law." He concludes that laws, when good, should be supreme. Political rulers should merely complement the law by acting as its guardians and ministers. They should only regulate those matters on which the laws are unable to speak with precision owing to the difficulty of any general principle embracing all particulars. (Aristotle, Politics, 1282b).

Aristotle gives four reasons for emphasizing law's autonomy over the will of the political ruler. First, law frees the state from the desires and passions that afflict political rulers. "The law is reason unaffected by desire. Desire … is a wild beast, and passion perverts the minds of rulers, even when they are the best of men." (Aristotle, Politics, 1287a). Second, tyranny results when political rulers exercise autonomy over law, even in democracies. Third, the orderly rotation of political offices requires autonomous laws. Equality, liberty, justice, and expediency mandate that every mature citizen participates in governing the state. Fourth, the orderly rotation of political offices preserves the state by assuring evenhanded administration by magistrates.

Aristotle utilizes law's historical dimension to secure legal justice through custom. Aristotle uses the term nomos for law, and nomos includes custom and convention as components of the social norm. Aristotle writes in the Politics that legal custom is itself a form of justice. Custom and convention maintain social stability by encouraging obedience to the law. The law has no power to command obedience except that of habit, which can only be given by time. Aristotle urges caution in changing the law because changes enfeeble the power of the law. If the advantage of a change is small, it is wiser to leave errors in the law. The citizens usually lose more by the habit of disobedience than they gain by changing the law. (Aristotle, Politics, 1255a, 1269a).

Aristotle utilizes law's moral dimension to secure natural justice in two ways. The first is by nullifying positive laws that subvert natural law precepts. Aristotle formulates a natural law standard of legal validity. Aristotle's Rhetoric describes natural law as an unwritten law, based on nature, and common to all people. "There is in nature a common principle of the just and unjust that all people in some way divine." (Aristotle, Rhetoric, 1373b).

Natural law provides immutable and universal standards of justice. Natural law constitutes a separate body of binding law that exceeds positive law in authority. Human actions should complete nature rather than subvert it, and natural law nullifies positive laws that subvert natural law precepts. (Aristotle, Rhetoric, 1373b).

Like Plato, Aristotle argues that the universal standards of natural law justify disobeying positive laws. Aristotle's Rhetoric provides two examples invalidating positive law for violating natural law precepts. The first is the case of Sophocles' Antigone, where Antigone disobeys Creon's order and provides funeral rites to her brother Polyneices. The second is Aristotle's guide to jury nullification of written law by appealing to higher principles of natural law. (Aristotle, Rhetoric, 1373b, 1375a-b).

Aristotle never explains why natural law wields supremacy over positive law. The supremacy of natural law is consistent, however, with Aristotle's view in the Physics that the ultimate causes of nature are divine. (Aristotle, Physics, 198b-199b).

The second way that Aristotle secures natural justice is by fostering virtue. Aristotle believed that human happiness depended on virtue more than liberty. The government is thus responsible for producing a virtuous state, and this is best accomplished through law. Although virtue encompasses more than mere conformity to law, virtue will only develop and flourish in a state that supports the legal enforcement of virtue. The state must provide moral education through its laws to make its citizens just and good. Failing to do so undermines the state's political system and harms its citizens. (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, 1179b; Politics, 1280b, 1310a, 1337a).

4. Cicero

Marcus Tullius Cicero (106-43 B. C. E.) was a politician, philosopher, orator, and attorney. Cicero's De Legibus (The Laws), De Officis (On Duties), and De Re Publica (The Republic) greatly influence the natural law tradition. Cicero esteemed Plato and Aristotle. Although not a Stoic, Cicero adopted Stoicism's divine Nature as the source of natural law precepts that dictate legal validity. The histories of Herodotus, Thucydides, Xenophon, and Polybius persuaded Cicero that natural law imposes justice on human events.

Cicero's signature contribution to jurisprudence is his explication of Nature as divine lawgiver. Law and justice originate in Nature as a divinely ordained set of universal moral principles. Cicero describes Nature as the omnipotent ruler of the universe, the omnipresent observer of every individual's intentions and actions, and the common master of all people. Belief in divine Nature stabilizes society, encourages obedience to law, and leads to individual virtue. (Cicero, De Legibus, 2.15-16).

Law's moral dimension dominates Cicero's jurisprudence. Cicero defines natural law as perfect reason in commanding and prohibiting. These principles are the sole source of justice and provide the sole standard of legal validity. "True law is right reason in agreement with Nature." (Cicero, De Re Publica, 3.33).

The precepts of natural law are eternal and immutable. They apply universally at all places, at all times, and to all people. Natural law summons to duty by its commands, and averts from wrongdoing by its prohibitions. Nature serves as the enforcing judge of natural law precepts, and Nature's punishment for violating natural law precepts is inescapable. (Cicero, De Re Publica, 3.33).

Natural law provides the naturae norma, the standard of legal validity for positive law and custom. The naturae norma provides the only means for separating good provisions from bad. Justice entails that laws and customs comply with the naturae norma and preserve the peace, happiness, and safety of the state and its citizens. Positive laws and customs that fail to do so are not regarded as laws at all. (Cicero, De Legibus, 1.44, 2.11-2.14).

Regarding Cicero's political dimension of law, the magistrate's limited role is to govern and to issue orders that are just and advantageous in keeping with the laws. Although the magistrate has some control of the people, the laws are fully in control of the magistrate. An official is the speaking law, and the law is a nonspeaking official. (Cicero, De Legibus, 3.2).

Political rulers cannot alter, repeal, or abolish natural law precepts. Furthermore, political rulers have no role in interpreting or explaining natural law precepts. Every man can discern the precepts of natural law for himself through reason. (Cicero, De Re Publica, 3.33).

Political rulers must issue just commands as measured by natural law precepts. Individuals are protected against unjust coercion. Although rulers may use sanctions to enforce legitimate commands, every affected subject has the right to appeal to the people before enforcement of any sanction. Furthermore, no ruler can issue commands concerning single individuals. Any significant sanction against an individual, such as execution or loss of citizenship, is reserved to the highest assembly of the people. As a further protection, all laws must be officially recorded by the censors. (Cicero, De Re Publica, 2.53-2.54; De Legibus, 3.10-3.47).

Like Aristotle, Cicero requires that magistrates be subject to the power of others. Successive terms are forbidden, and ten years must pass before the magistrate becomes eligible for the same office. Every magistrate leaving office must submit an account of his official acts to the censors. Misconduct is subject to prosecution. No magistrate may give or receive any gifts while seeking or holding office, or after the conclusion of his term. (Cicero, De Legibus, 3.9-3.11).

Regarding Cicero's historical dimension of law, Cicero agrees with Aristotle that custom maintains social stability by encouraging obedience to law. Custom can even achieve immortality for the commonwealth. The commonwealth will be eternal if citizens conduct their lives in accordance with ancestral laws and customs. (Cicero, De Re Publica, 3.41).

5. Justinian's Corpus Juris Civilis

The Corpus Juris Civilis (Body of Civil Law) codified Roman law pursuant to the decree of Justinian I. Completed in A.D. 535, the four works of the Corpus became the sole legal authorities in the empire. The Institutes was a law school text. The Codex contained statutes dating from A.D. 76. The Digest contained commentaries by leading jurists, and the New Laws was supplemented as new laws became necessary.

The Corpus is the direct ancestor of modtern Wester civil law systems. Its influence on canon law is seen in the medieval maim Ecclesia vivit lege romana (the Church lives on Roman law). Common law jurisprudence never accepted the Corpus as binding authority. Nevertheless, its twelfth century revival profoundly influenced the formation of common law jurisprudence through the works of the father of the common law, Henry de Bracton (C. E. 1210 – C. E. 1268).

The Corpus divides law into public law involving state interests and private law governing individuals. Private law is a mixture of natural law, the law of nations, and municipal law. The Corpus establishes a clear hierarchy among law's three dimensions. The moral dimension occupies the highest position and provides the standard of legal validity. The historical dimension of legal custom occupies the second position, and the political dimension of Roman municipal law occupies the lowest position.

The Corpus' moral dimension resides in two bodies of law, natural law and the law of nations. Like Cicero, the Corpus originates natural law in a divine lawgiver. "The laws of nature, which are observed by all nations alike, are established by divine providence." The precepts of natural law are universal, eternal, and immutable. (Justinian, Institutes, 1.2.11; Digest, 1.3.2).

Natural law governs all land, air, and sea creatures, including man. "The law of nature is that which she has taught all animals; a law not peculiar to the human race, but shared by all living creatures." The Corpus extends natural law to "all living creatures" to repudiate the Sophist arguments that law is merely a human convention with no basis in nature, justice does not exist, and there is no duty to obey law. The Corpus' rebuttal focuses on the highly socialized behavior of such animal species as ants, bees, and birds. Although animals cannot legislate or form social conventions, they nevertheless follow norms of behavior. These norms affirm the existence of natural law. (Justinian, Institutes, 1.1.3, 2.1.11).

The Institutes and the Digest state three precepts of natural law: "Honeste vivere, alterum non laedere, suum cuique tribuere." Live honorably, injure no one, and give every man his due. (Justinian, Institutes, 1.1.3; Digest, 1.1.10). These precepts track the Crito's admonishments to live well, harm no one, and honor agreements so long as they are honorable. (Plato, Crito, 47e-49e). Blackstone's Commentaries adopts these exact precepts. (Blackstone 1828, p. 27).

The law of nations is the portion of natural law that governs relations between human beings. (Justinian, Digest, 1.4). Its rules are "prescribed by natural reason for all men" and "observed by all peoples alike." The law of nations is the source of duties to God, one's parents, and one's country. It recognizes human rights to life, liberty, and self-defense, and its recognition of property rights enables contracts and commerce between peoples.

The precepts of natural law provide the standard for legal validity. This standard voids any right or duty violating natural law precepts. The Institutes provides illustrative examples: Contracts created for immoral purposes, such as carrying out a homicide or a sacrilege, are not enforceable. (Justinian, Institutes, 3.19.24). Immorality invalidates wrongful profits. Anyone profiting from wrongful dominion over another's property must disgorge those profits.(Justinian, Digest, 5.3.52).

Immorality invalidates agency relationships. Agents are not obliged to carry out immoral instructions from their principals. If they do, they are not entitled to indemnity from their principals for any liability the agents incur. (Justinian, Institutes, 3.26.7). Immorality even invalidates bequests and legacies if the bequest is contingent upon immoral conduct.(Justinian, Institutes, 2.20.36).  

The Corpus' historical dimension provides custom as a source of enforceable law. The Corpus defines legal custom as the tacit consent of a people established by long-continued habit. Since custom evidences the consent of the people, it is a higher source of law than positive or statutory law.Statutory provisions, if customarily ignored, are treated like repealed legislation. (Justinian, Digest, 1.1.3).

Legal custom establishes the autonomy of law over political rulers. Custom binds judges. A judge's first duty is "to not judge contrary to statutes, the imperial laws, and custom." Legal custom even controls statutory interpretation. "Custom is the best interpreter of statutes." (Justinian, Institutes, 4.17; Digest, 1.1.37).

The Corpus' political dimension resides in its six categories of Roman municipal law, the "statutes, plebiscites, senatusconsults, enactments of the Emperors, edicts of the magistrates, and answers of those learned in the law." In contrast to natural law and the law of nations, Roman municipal law was unique to Rome. Its provisions were also "subject to frequent change, either by the tacit consent of the people, or by the subsequent enactment of another statute." (Justinian, Institutes, 1.2.3, 1.2.11).

6. Aquinas

Thomas Aquinas' Summa Theologica recognizes all three dimensions of law as potential sources of valid law. The moral dimension wields supremacy, however, through a rigid standard of legal validity. Human laws that fail this standard are not merely unenforceable; they are "perversions of law," "acts of violence," and "no law at all." (Aquinas, Summa Theologica, quest. 94 art. 4; quest. 95 art. 2).

Common law jurisprudence has never accepted Aquinas' natural law theory. It differs in important ways from Blackstone's natural law theory. Thomism nevertheless influenced the philosophical method taught in Roman Catholic institutions. Martin Luther King Jr. invoked Aquinas' natural law theory in the Birmingham jail to justify civil disobedience, and Aquinas' theory motivates contemporary opponents of abortion and euthanasia.

Question 97 establishes both God and man as lawgivers. Divine and natural law come from the rational will of God. Human law comes from the will of man, regulated by reason. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 97 art. 3).

Question 90 defines four existence conditions for law. The first condition is that law is an ordinance of reason, that law is created by a being with reason to achieve a goal. The second condition is that the law has the common good as its goal and that laws must distribute their burdens equitably and proportionately among their subjects. The third condition is a lawgiver who has care of the community because unless the lawgiver holds sufficient power to coerce obedience, the law cannot induce its subjects to virtue. The fourth condition is publication, which is required for law to have the binding force to compel obedience. Each condition is necessary for law, and together they are sufficient. Failing any condition renders a purported law an act of violence. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 96 art. 1-4).

Question 91 divides law into four types. Eternal law is the set of timeless truths that govern the movement and behavior of all things in the universe, including human beings. Divine law is the word of God revealed to man to guide him to his supernatural end. God reveals divine law to operate because human reason is inadequate to discover its precepts. Natural law is that portion of the eternal law that governs the behavior of human beings. Natural law is derived from eternal law, and its precepts are discovered by reason. Human law is any law of human authorship. Man creates human law in order to implement the precepts of natural law. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 91 art. 1-4).

Question 94 presents Aquinas' theory of natural law. God writes natural law in the hearts of men, and man discerns the natural law using practical reason. Four natural inclinations enable man to discern the precepts of natural law. The first is an inclination to seek after good. The second is an inclination to preserve one's own according to one's nature. Man shares these first two inclinations with all substances. The third is an inclination to reproduce, raise, and educate one's offspring. Man shares this inclination with animals. The fourth is an inclination "to know the truth about God and to live in society." This inclination is unique to man. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 94 art. 2).

Aquinas divides natural law into "first principles" and "secondary principles." First principles are unchanging. They are always known by all human beings and they are binding on all human beings. They are mutually consistent, and conflict between them is impossible. They cannot be "blotted out from men's hearts." (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 94 art. 6).

The first principles of natural law contain four precepts, each reflecting one of man's natural inclinations. The first precept is to pursue good and avoid evil. The second is to preserve life and ward off its obstacles. The third is to reproduce, raise, and educate one's offspring. The fourth is to pursue knowledge and to live together in society. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 94 art. 2).

Secondary principles of natural law differ significantly from first principles. Secondary principles are subject to change, albeit rarely and for special causes. They are not always known by all persons and they are not always binding. These differences result from practical reason's susceptibility to perversion by passion, evil habits, and evil dispositions. Lastly, secondary principles can be blotted out from men's hearts through "evil persuasions," errors in "speculative matters," vicious customs," and "corrupt habits." (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 94 art. 6).

Secondary principles form three categories. The first involves secondary principles that are always known by all persons and are always binding, such as "do not murder or slay the innocent." The second category involves principles that are always binding but not always known, such as "do not steal." Julius Caesar reports in the Gallic Wars, for example, that the Germans did not know it was wrong to steal. The third category involves principles that are not always binding, such as "goods entrusted to another should be restored." Although usually binding, this principle does not bind the return of another's weapons to be used against one's country. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 94 art. 4).

Questions 95 through 97 discuss human law. Human law exists because the great variety of human affairs prevents the first principles of natural law from being applied to all men in the same way. Human reason derives human law from natural law precepts for particular matters, and this process creates a diversity of positive law among different peoples. The "force" accorded to human law depends on the method by which it is derived from natural law. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 95 art. 2).

Aquinas specifies two methods. The first method involves taking a "conclusion" from a premise of natural law. As in science, reason draws specific conclusions of human law by demonstration from natural law principles. Reason demonstrates the human law conclusion that "one must not kill" from the natural law principle that "one should do harm to no man." Human laws derived by this method have some force of natural law. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 95 art. 2).

The second method for deriving human law involves making a "determination" from generalities of natural law. As in the arts, details are derived from general forms. A carpenter begins with the general form of a house in his mind, but he must determine the details of its construction as he builds it. Reason determines that murderers should be imprisoned for twenty years from the natural law principle that evildoers should be punished. Unlike conclusions of human law, determinations have no force of natural law. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 95 art. 2).

Question 96 provides a narrow scope for human law. Human laws should not repress all the vices forbidden by natural law. Since most people are incapable of abstaining from all vices, human law should only prohibit those vices whose suppression is essential for preserving society. Human laws should prohibit murder and theft but remain silent as to lesser vices. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 96 art. 2).

The Summa provides a fully developed standard of legal validity. Question 96 provides that human laws must be just. Justice requires that human laws accomplish both divine good and human good as described below. Unjust laws are not merely unenforceable; they are perversions of law and acts of violence, and they are powerless to bind the conscience. They are, in fact, not laws at all. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 96 art. 4).

Human laws accomplish divine good by satisfying the requirements of natural law and divine law. Purported laws that conflict with divine good, natural law or divine law should always be disobeyed. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 96 art. 4).

Human laws accomplish human good if and only if they meet three conditions. First, the end of the law must be the common good. Second, the human lawgiver must not exceed his power in establishing the law. Third, the burdens of the law must be shared equitably and proportionately by all members of society. Failure to meet any of these conditions renders the purported law unjust. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 96 art. 4).

Purported laws that conflict with human good are unjust and may usually be disobeyed. If the purported law fails to meet one of the standards for human good, it may be disobeyed. An exception arises, however, if disobedience results in "greater harm" or creates a scandal. The unjust human law should then be obeyed, even though it is not truly a law. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 96 art. 4).

Critics often charge that Aquinas' claim that "an unjust law is no law at all" is incoherent. This criticism seemingly disregards Aquinas' definition of law in Question 95. Laws have "just so much of the nature of law" as they are derived from natural law. Natural law is always just. To be considered law "at all," therefore, human laws must be just. A purported law that is unjust is not truly a law. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 95 art. 2).

7. Blackstone

Sir William Blackstone's Commentaries on the Laws of England is the standard statement of common law jurisprudence. Blackstone imposes two standards of legal validity, one based on custom and the other on natural law. Purported laws that fail these standards are not merely "bad law," they are "not law." (Blackstone 1838, p. 47).

Law's historical dimension provides the validity standard based on custom and serves as the primary source of human law. The historical dimension also emphasizes the autonomy of custom over the will of political rulers. Law's moral dimension provides the validity standard based on natural law. The moral dimension also establishes natural rights as limits on the will of the political ruler and protects these rights through due process. The political dimension provides only a limited source of law, and the historical and moral dimensions severely restrict the political ruler's ability to enforce his will through legal coercion.

Law's historical dimension dominates Blackstone's jurisprudence. Custom is "the first ground and chief corner stone" of common law. Custom includes rules of law, such as the rule of primogeniture, which says the oldest male descendant inherits the entire estate. Custom also includes legal principles in the forms of maxims, such as "the king can do no wrong," "no man is bound to accuse himself," and "no man ought to benefit from his own wrong." Law’s historical dimension is so strong in common law that approved statutes were strictly construed and interpreted whenever possible to comply with pre-existing custom. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 46, 50).

Blackstone divides customary law into three types. The first type, "general customs," applies to the entire kingdom. The second type, "particular customs," only apply to limited regions or specialized groups like merchants. For illustration, the "general custom" of inheritance for England is primogeniture where the eldest son inherits all. Nevertheless, the "particular custom" of gavelkind permits shared inheritance in Kent. The third type, "peculiar laws," includes Roman civil law and Catholic canon law. These laws have no authority in England except as the people have consented to their provisions through customary observance. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 45-57).

The validity standard for custom includes seven requirements. First, the custom must "have been used so long, that the memory of man runs not to the contrary." Proof of any time when the custom did not exist voids the custom. Second, the custom must enjoy continuous observance, interruption voids the custom. Third, the custom must enjoy peaceable observance. Custom depends upon consent, and disputed customs lack consent. Fourth, customs must be "reasonable" and must not create unnecessary hardships.Fifth, the custom must be certain. A custom that the worthiest son inherits is void because no certain standard for worthiness exists. Sixth, compliance must be mandatory. Optional customs have no coercive force. Lastly, customs must be consistent. Inconsistent customs lack mutual consent. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 53-55).

Law's moral dimension provides a standard of legal validity based on natural law. Blackstone's natural law founds justice on the eternal and immutable laws of good and evil to which the creator himself conforms. God is a being of infinite power, infinite wisdom, and infinite goodness. Although God endows man with reason and free will, man is still "entirely dependent" on God. Man is subject to God's law, and God's law is natural law. Natural law is binding over the entire globe, in all countries, and at all times. No human laws are of any validity if they conflict with natural law, and valid human laws derive all their force and authority from natural law.

Natural law precepts are discernible by reason as far as they are necessary for the conduct of human actions. Unlike Aquinas, however, Blackstone regards human reason as "frail, imperfect, and blind" since man's fall. To overcome these defects of human reason, God reveals the precepts of natural law through direct revelation in scripture. The validity of human law depends on the two foundations of natural law and revealed law. Human laws contradicting their precepts are void.

Natural law permits acts that promote true happiness and prohibits acts that destroy it. Natural law derives from the precept “that man should pursue his own true and substantial happiness.” God created human nature so that man obtains happiness by pursuing justice. Injustice brings unhappiness.

Substantively, natural law consists of eternal immutable laws of good and evil. Blackstone adopts three precepts of natural law from Justinian's Institutes. “Such, among others, are these principles: that we should live honestly, should hurt nobody, and should render to every one his due; to which three general precepts Justinian has reduced the whole doctrine of law.” (Blackstone 1838, pp. 27-28).

Blackstone divides jurisprudence into natural law and positive law. Positive law provisions contrary to natural law are invalid. Individuals are furthermore bound to disobey them, such as laws requiring murder. Nevertheless, natural law does not determine every legal issue. Natural law is indifferent, for example, as to whether positive law permits the export of wool. On most issues, man is at liberty to adopt positive laws that benefit society. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 28-29).

Blackstone divides rights into two types, absolute rights and relative rights. The “immutable laws of nature” vest absolute rights in individuals. Individuals enjoy absolute rights in the state of nature, prior to the formation of society. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 88, 94).

Blackstone names three absolute rights: personal security, personal liberty, and private property. The absolute right of personal security consists of the legal enjoyment of life, limb, body, health, and reputation. The absolute right of personal liberty consists of the free power of movement without imprisonment or restraint unless by due course of law. The absolute right of property consists of the free use and disposal of lawful acquisitions, without injury or illegal diminution. (Blackstone 1838, pp 93-100).

Relative rights, in contrast to absolute rights, exist only in society. Relative rights protect and maintain inviolate the three absolute rights of personal security, personal liberty, and private property. Unlike absolute rights, which are few and simple, relative rights are more numerous and more complicated. Such rights include due process protections as well as "Blackstone's ratio," which says it is better that ten guilty persons escape than one innocent party suffers. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 89, 102).

Law's political dimension is severely delimited in Blackstone's jurisprudence. Society is formed for the protection of individuals. In addition to the validity standards discussed above, Blackstone's historical dimension dictates a near absolute standard of legal autonomy. Law wields supremacy over the will of political rulers, whether they are kings or judges. (Blackstone 1838, p. 32).

Regarding the autonomy of law over kings, the most important maxim in English history is "the law makes the king; the king does not make the law." This maxim dates from Henry de Bracton's 1235 treatise The Laws and Customs of the Kingdom of England. “The king must not be under man but under God and under the law, because the law makes the king … there is no king where the will and not the law has dominion.” (De Bracton 1968, p. 33).

Regarding the autonomy of law over judges, Blackstone’s "declaratory theory" prohibits judges from making new law. Judges may only find and declare existing law; they may never make law. Judge-made law unites the power to make and enforce law in one body, and this invites tyranny. The judge should determine the law according to the known laws and customs of the land, not his own private judgment. Judges are not appointed to pronounce new laws. (Blackstone 1838, p. 46, 105).

Nevertheless, since all law is subject to the standard of reason, judges may set aside common law precedents that are contrary to reason as “manifestly absurd or unjust.” Setting unreasonable precedents aside does not create new law. Instead, it vindicates the law from misrepresentation. Unreasonable rules of common law, by definition, are not law. Such precedents are not set aside because they are bad law, but because they are not law. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 46-47).

In applying statutory law, however, the judge may never exercise his discretion to set aside the will of Parliament. The only authority that can declare an act of Parliament void is Parliament itself. The judge must “interpret and obey” its mandates. Judges may never act as miniature legislatures. “In a democracy,” writes Blackstone, “the right of making laws resides in the people at large.” (Blackstone 1838, pp. 27, 33). 

8. Bentham

Legal positivism rejects law's moral and historical dimensions as sources of law or standards of legal validity. H. L. A. Hart is the most important figure in the positivist tradition that begins with Jeremy Bentham and John Austin. Bentham was sixteen when he attended a series of private lectures by Blackstone on the common law. These lectures were later published as Blackstone's Commentaries.

The young Bentham listened with rebel ears. Bentham's anonymous Fragment on Government describes Blackstone’s natural law theory as “theological grimgribber” and an “excursion into the land of fancy.” Bentham describes Blackstone as "the dupe of every prejudice," "the accomplice of every chicanery," "the abettor of every abuse," and "a treasury of vulgar errors." (Bentham 1977, 10).

Bentham’s legal theory has two distinctive features. The first is Bentham's exclusion of law's historical dimension. Bentham’s “imperative” theory of law defines law as (1) the assemblage of signs of a sovereign’s volition, (2) directing the conduct of persons under his power, (3) accompanied by an “expectation” in such persons, that (4) motivates obedience. The sovereign's will provides its own validity standard. Custom is excluded and the ruler wields autonomy over law. (Bentham 1970, p. 1).

Bentham's second distinctive feature is his exclusion of law's moral dimension. Law for Bentham has no necessary conceptual connection with morality. Bentham abandons Blackstone's immutable standards of right and wrong for physical sensations of pleasure and pain: “Nature has placed mankind under the governance of two sovereign masters, pain and pleasure. It is for them alone to point out what we ought to do.” (Bentham 1907, p. 1).

Bentham's Anarchical Fallacies argues that natural laws and natural rights are imaginary. "Natural rights is simple nonsense: natural and imprescriptable rights, nonsense upon stilts." Positive law is the only real law. Only positive law can create real rights, and positive law requires the existence of a sovereign. There can be no rights outside the existence of a sovereign command, and no rights can exist prior to the formation of a government. In sum, the will of the sovereign provides its own standard of legal validity, unrestrained by morality, custom, or the autonomy of law. (Bentham 1843, pp. 501-05).

9. Austin

John Austin's The Province of Jurisprudence Determined defines law's political dimension as the sole source of law and legal validity. Like Bentham's "imperative" theory, Austin's "command" theory of law establishes the political ruler's will as its own standard of legal validity. The sovereign can coerce his will through law without restraint by moral principles, custom, or the autonomy of law.

Austin's "command" theory defines law as (a) commands, (b) backed by threat of sanctions, (c) from a sovereign, (d) to whom people have a habit of obedience. A common criticism of Austin's theory is that the command of a gun-wielding highwayman arguably satisfies Austin's definition of law.

The "command" theory rejects law's historical dimension. Legal customs and principles play no part in law. Law wields no autonomy over the political ruler's will, including the will of judges. In contrast to Blackstone, Austin encourages judges to legislate from the bench. Society cannot function unless judges are free to make new law to correct the negligence and incapacity of legislatures. (Austin 2000, p. 191, 225-31).

Austin's "command" theory rejects law's moral dimension as well. Austin labels Blackstone's natural law validity standard "stark nonsense." God's law is uncertain, and Blackstone's natural law standard preaches anarchy. Austin writes that "the existence of law is one thing; its merit and demerit another. Whether it be or be not is one enquiry; whether it be or be not conformable to an assumed standard, is a different enquiry. A law, which actually exists, is a law, though we happen to dislike it." (Austin 2000, p. 184).

10. Hart

Hart’s 1957 lecture “Positivism and the Separation of Law and Morals” emphasizes three doctrines asserted by Bentham and Austin. The first, which Hart retains, is an emphasis on "the meaning of the distinctive vocabulary of the law." The second doctrine, which Hart retains, is the separation of law and morals. Hart holds law “as it is” distinct from law “as it ought to be.” This distinction rejects moral standards as the test for legal validity. (Hart 1958, pp. 594, 601).

The third doctrine, which Hart rejects, is Austin's command theory of law. Hart rejects Austin’s theory for four reasons. First, Austin fails to recognize that laws generally apply to those who enact them. Second, Austin does not account for laws granting public powers, such as the power to legislate or adjudicate, or for laws granting private powers to create or modify legal relations. Third, Austin fails to account for laws that originate, not from a sovereign, but out of common custom. Fourth, Austin fails to account for the continuity of legislative authority characteristic of a modern legal system. (Hart 1994, p. 70).

Hart replaces Austin's "command" theory with a model of law as the union of primary and secondary social rules. A primary rule is a rule that imposes an obligation or a duty. “[P]rimary rules are concerned with the actions that individuals must or must not do,” such as restrictions on "violence, theft, and deception." A rule imposes an obligation or duty when the demand for conformity is insistent and the social pressure brought to bear upon those who deviate from the rule is great. (Hart 1994, pp. 91, 94).

In order for a system of primary rules to function effectively, Hart states that secondary rules may also be necessary to provide an authoritative statement of all the primary rules. In contrast to primary rules, which impose obligations and duties, secondary rules confer powers to introduce, to change, or to modify a primary rule. These powers may be public or private.  (Hart 1994, pp. 96-97).

There are three types of secondary rules. The first type is the rule of change. This rule allows legislators to make changes in the primary rules if the primary rules are defective or inadequate. The second type is the rule of adjudication. This rule enables courts to resolve disputes regarding the interpretation and application of primary rules. The third type of secondary rule is the rule of recognition. The rule of recognition provides “a rule for conclusive identification of the primary rules of obligation.” It also provides Hart's criterion for legal validity. A rule of law is legally valid if it conforms to the requirements of the rule of recognition. (Hart 1994, pp. 95-98, 103-05).

Hart next turns from defining the validity criteria for individual laws to defining the validity criteria for entire legal systems. System validity is determined by the attitudes of citizens and public officials toward obedience to legal rules. Hart describes two contrasting attitudes, the "external" and "internal" points of view.

The external point of view is the view of a person who feels no obligation to follow the law. He has no sense that it is right to follow the law or wrong not to do so. He rejects law as the standard of conduct for himself or others. The internal point of view, on the other hand, is the view of a person who feels obligated to follow the law. He follows the law because he thinks it is right to do so and wrong not to do so. He feels that he ought, must, and should follow the law. (Hart 1994, pp. 56-57).

The validity of a legal system depends on only two conditions. First, private citizens must generally obey the primary rules of obligation. It is sufficient that citizens take an external point of view toward primary rules. Second, public officials must adopt the rule of recognition specifying the criteria for legal validity as their “public standard of official behavior.” It is a minimum, necessary condition that officials take the internal point of view toward secondary rules. (Hart 1994, pp. 116-17).

Hart's standard of legal validity functions solely in law's political dimension. The will of the political rulers determines the validity of law by their adoption of a rule of recognition. The will of the political rulers determines the validity of the legal system as well. The only necessary condition for a valid legal system is the political rulers' adoption of the internal point of view.

Hart excludes the historical dimension from his standard of legal validity. Hart omits, for example, two of the historical dimension's traditional restraints on the will of the political ruler. The first, emphasized since Aristotle, is the autonomy of law over political rulers. Instead, Hart's political rulers wield autonomy over law by controlling the standard of legal validity. Hart also grants judges autonomy over law by rejecting Blackstone's declaratory theory that judges find but do not make law. If the judge determines the meaning of a legal rule to be "indeterminate or incomplete," the judge “must exercise his discretion and make law for the case instead of merely applying already pre-existing settled law.”

The second historical restraint, emphasized by Locke and Blackstone, is the validity requirement of consent by the governed. Consent is irrelevant to Hart's legal validity. It is sufficient that each member of the population obeys Hart's primary rules “from any motive whatsoever.” "Any motive," as Hart's critics point out, includes terror and force.

Hart also excludes law's moral dimension from his standard of legal validity. Hart accepts "morally iniquitous" laws as legally valid. "There are no necessary conceptual connections between the content of law and morality; and hence morally iniquitous provisions may be valid as legal rules or principles. One aspect of this form of the separation of law from morality is that there can be legal rights and duties which have no moral justification or force whatever." (Hart 1994, p. 268).

11. Radbruch

Gustav Radbruch utilizes legal history to support a validity standard invoking law's moral dimension. Radbruch, once Germany's leading positivist, argues that the positivist separation of law and morality facilitated Hitler's atrocities through legal means. Radbruch argues that German positivism rendered "jurists and the people alike defenseless against arbitrary, cruel, or criminal laws, however extreme they might be. In the end, the positivistic theory equates law with power; there is law only where there is power." (Radbruch 2006b, p. 13). Positivism, in other words, operates only in law's political dimension.

Radbruch blames the positivistic legal thinking that held sway over German jurists for rendering impotent every possible defence against the abuses of National Socialist legislation. Radbruch warns, "We must arm ourselves against the recurrence of an outlaw state like Hitler’s by fundamentally overcoming positivism." Radbruch's solution is a standard of legal validity invoking law's moral dimension. (Radbruch 2006a, p. 8).

This validity standard, known as "Radbruch's Formula," has been applied by German courts. In cases where the discrepancy between justice and statutory law becomes "unbearable," the statute is held void ab initio in the interest of justice. "Radbruch's Formula" holds such statutes void ab initio because they are not truly laws.

Radbruch explains: "Where there is not even an attempt at justice, where equality, the core of justice, is deliberately betrayed in the issuance of positive law, then the statute is not merely ‘flawed law’, it lacks completely the very nature of law. For law, including positive law, cannot be otherwise defined than as a system and an institution whose very meaning is to serve justice. Measured by this standard, whole portions of National Socialist law never attained the dignity of valid law." (Radbruch 2006a, p. 7). Radbruch thus joins Cicero, Aquinas, and Blackstone in concluding that unjust laws are not laws at all.

12. Positivism in American Jurisprudence

Hart's separation of law from morality stimulated significant criticism in the United States. Lon Fuller's The Morality of Law argues that law is subject to an internal morality consisting of eight principles. Laws must be enforced, for example, in a manner consistent with their wording. Legal systems that violate these principles cannot achieve social order. They destroy any moral obligation to obey the law. (Fuller 1964, pp. 33-40).

Ronald Dworkin's "The Model of Rules" argues that Hart's model of law is incomplete. Courts often decide difficult cases according to legal principles that provide moral justifications for case outcomes. One example is the common law maxim that no man should profit from his own wrongful conduct. These legal principles are outside Hart's definition of primary and secondary rules. (Dworkin 1967, pp. 23-24).

Hart's legal positivism nevertheless exerts significant influence in American jurisprudence. Four factors enhance Hart's influence. The first occurred in 1871 when Dean Christopher Langdell of Harvard Law School dropped Blackstone's Commentaries from Harvard's legal curriculum. Blackstone's jurisprudence lost influence as other schools followed.

The second enhancing factor is the erosion of law's moral dimension. Oliver Wendell Holmes, Jr. is a leading figure in this process. Holmes advocated for law without values and identified himself as a skeptic. Holmes defines truth as the majority vote of any nation that is more powerful than all the others. Holmes equates a jurist searching for validity criteria in natural law to the poor devil who must get drunk to satisfy his demand for the superlative. (Holmes 1918, p. 40).

Holmes' "Path of the Law" presents an early form of positivism. Holmes argues for the separation of law and morality. Holmes supports banishing every word of moral significance from the law. He rejects every ethical obligation in contract law. Holmes advocates a "bad man" perspective that looks at law as a bad man who feels no obligation to obey it. This is an early statement of Hart's "external point of view." (Holmes 1997, pp. 991-997).

The third factor enhancing Hart's influence is the erosion of law's historical dimension. Dean Roscoe Pound of Harvard Law School illustrates its erosion. Pound's "Mechanical Jurisprudence" advocates abandoning custom as a source of any law. Pound urged replacing the common law system based on custom with a civil code system based on statutes. (Pound 1908, 605-23).

The fourth factor enhancing Hart's influence is the natural desire of judges to “make” new law. Blackstone’s "declaratory theory" forbids judge-made law, but Hart's "penumbra doctrine" considers it an ordinary and necessary judicial function. One striking example of Hart's influence is Griswold v. Connecticut, 281 U.S. 479 (1965). Griswold applies a penumbra analysis to imply a Constitutional right of privacy while admitting no such right appears in the language of the Constitution. The Supreme Court decided Roe v. Wade, 410 U.S. 113 (1973) based on Griswold's implied right of privacy. The increased willingness of judges to legislate from the bench in 20th and 21st Century American courts is Hart's most significant and controversial legacy in American jurisprudence.

13. A Fresh Approach

Augustine's City of God observes that kingdoms without justice are but great bands of robbers. Robbers become rulers, not by the removal of greed, but by the addition of impunity. (Augustine 1998, p.147-48). Validity standards are the primary means by which societies deny impunity to unjust rulers. Legal validity governs the enforceability of law, and the standard of legal validity controls the ruler's ability to enforce his will through legal coercion.

Standards of legal validity are historically cyclical, and the cycle continued in the United States during the 21st Century. American law initially embraced Blackstone's dual validity standards based on moral principles and legal custom. Centuries of challengers have eroded those standards. Bentham, Austin, Holmes, and Hart eroded Blackstone's moral standard by advocating the separation of law from morality. Pound eroded Blackstone's customary standard by advocating the abandonment of common law. Legal educators dropped Blackstone from their curriculum.

These challengers eroded Blackstone's validity standards, but they did not supplant them. A validity schism divided American jurisprudence. There was no generally accepted validity standard in American law. Academic theorists and legal educators favored Hart for his analytical clarity. Liberal judges favored Hart for increasing their power to make new law. Practitioners and conservative judges favored Blackstone for his emphasis on consent of the governed, autonomy of law, predictability of law, and morally just decisions.

Two irreconcilable bodies of precedent  emerge, one formulated by traditional judges who limit themselves to finding existing law, the other by positivist judges who make new law. As judges increasingly make new law, courts become unpredictable, ex post facto rulings increase, and laws are unevenly applied. Unelected federal judges set aside democratic resolutions of political questions and decide policy issues without public input. Justices devise or limit Constitutional rights according to personal preference to achieve their desired case outcome.

Despite fifty years of debate, the opposing camps remain estranged. Each side utilizes methods its opponent will never accept. Blackstone, for example, formulates his moral precepts in terms of divine law and human reason. This formulation is unpersuasive for two reasons. First, there is no general agreement regarding the terms of divine law, and many reject its very existence. Second, Blackstone adopts inconsistent views of human reason. On one hand, human reason is too "frail, imperfect, and blind" to generate just human laws. On the other hand, human reason is sufficient to generate the precepts of natural law from revelations of divine law.

Legal positivism is unpersuasive as well, insisting on a narrow philosophical method to formulate its standard of legal validity. Hart emphasizes “a purely analytical study of legal concepts, a study of the meaning of the distinctive vocabulary of the law.” (Hart 1958, p. 601). He describes all law as consisting of only two types of rules. Hart's simplistic model of law is inadequate for three reasons.

First, Hart's analysis excludes law's historical and social contexts. Hart restricts his analysis to law's linguistic context. Law is more than linguistics. It encompasses the entirety of the great variety of human affairs. Hart's exclusion of these indispensible contexts commits the "analytical fallacy" described by John Dewey in "Context and Thought" (Dewey 1985, pp. 5-7).

Second, Hart's standard of legal validity ignores the content of law. Hart only considers the pedigree of the law's creation. Hart consequently accepts the validity of “morally iniquitous laws” whose content possesses “no moral justification or force whatsoever.” (Hart 1994, p. 268).

Hart ignores the grave consequences of enforcing "morally iniquitous" laws. For example, Hart validates legal systems if two conditions are met. First, citizens may take an external point of view toward primary rules. Obedience "from any motive whatsoever" is sufficient, permitting coercion through terror. Second, officials must take an internal point of view toward secondary rules. Objectively considered, the legal systems utilized by Stalin and Hitler satisfy both conditions.

Third, Hart's model of law as rules is incomplete. Something important is missing from a legal philosophy that validates the Soviet and Nazi legal systems. That missing element is justice, and justice is a moral concept. As Ronald Dworkin explains, courts usually decide difficult cases according to legal principles that provide moral justifications for case outcomes. Hart's model of rules excludes these principles. (Dworkin 1967, pp. 23-24).

Hart showed how to separate law from morality, but history showed why societies should not do so. Critics contend that a fresh approach is needed.

Neither Blackstone nor Hart assign legal history a significant role in formulating their validity standards. No major jurist since Cicero has done so. Nevertheless, a historical formulation of legal validity can avoid the problems described above. Unlike Blackstone, legal history does not require belief in a divine lawgiver, and unlike Hart, legal history does not ignore the content of law.

Legal history provides a long record of legal experimentation. A scientific approach identifies three principles that recur in just and stable legal systems. Legal systems without these principles repeatedly become arbitrary, unjust, and unstable.

The first principle is the principle of reason, which addresses the validity of law's content. The principle of reason recognizes that every subject is a rational creature with a free will. To be stable, the legal system must treat its subjects as ends in themselves, and not as a mere means to another end. The legal system must also permit rational individuals to orient their own behavior in order to achieve a society based on ordered liberty. Procedural due process protects against the punishment of the innocent and the tyranny of the majority. Substantive due process enables laws to provide dependable guideposts to individuals in orienting their behavior.

The second principle is the principle of consent, which addresses the validity of law's creation. This principle provides that the legitimacy of law derives from the consent of those subject to its power. Common law custom, the doctrine of stare decisis, and legislation sanctioned by the subjects' legitimate representatives are all evidence of consent.

The third principle is the principle of autonomy, which addresses both the content and the creation of law. Laws must wield supremacy over political rulers. The ruler must be under the same laws as his subjects, and the laws must not be subject to arbitrary change to reflect the ruler's will. To paraphrase de Bracton, the law must make the king. The king must not make the law. To paraphrase Aristotle, rightly constituted laws must be the final sovereign.

These principles operate in law's moral and historical dimensions to restrain the ruler's ability to enforce his will through legal coercion. Legal systems become unjust and unstable in the absence of such restraints. They project the power of the political ruler, but they are not valid legal systems. The history of the Western legal tradition is the history of revolutions against such systems. (Berman 1983).

14. References and Further Reading

  • Aquinas, Thomas. Treatise on Law (Summa Theologica, Questions 90-07). Ed. Ralph McInerny. Washington: Regnery, 1996. Print.
  • Aristotle. The Athenian Constitution. Trans. Sir Frederic G. Kenyon. Seaside, OR: Merchant, 2009. Print.
  • Aristotlte. Ethica Nichomachea. Trans. W.D. Ross. New York: Oxford UP, 2009. Print.
  • Aristotlte. Metaphysics. Trans. Joe Sachs. Santa Fe: Green Lion, 2002. Print.
  • Aristotlte. Physics. Trans. Robin Waterfield. Ed. David Bostock. Oxford: Oxford UP, 1996. Print.
  • Aristotlte. The Politics of Aristotle. Trans. Ernest Barker. Oxford: Oxford UP, 1946. Print.
  • Aristotlte. Rhetoric. Ed. W.D. Ross. Trans. W. Rhys Roberts. New York: Cosimo, 2010. Print.
  • Augustine. The City of God against the Pagans. Trans. R.W. Dyson. Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1998. Print.
  • Austin, John. The Province of Jurisprudence Determined. Amherst, NY: Prometheus, 2000. Print.
  • Bentham, Jeremy. “Anarchical Fallacies; Being an Examination of the Declarations of Rights Issued During the French Revolution.” The Works of Jeremy Bentham. 11 vols. Edinburgh: William Tait, 1838-43. Print.
  • Bentham, Jeremy. A Comment on the Commentaries and A Fragment on Government. Ed. J.H. Burns and H.L.A. Hart. London: Athlone, 1977. Print.
  • Bentham, Jeremy. An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation. Oxford: Clarendon, 1907. Print.
  • Bentham, Jeremy. Of Laws in General. Ed. H.L.A. Hart. London: Athlone, 1970. Print.
  • Berman, Harold J. Law and Revolution: The Formation of the Western Legal Tradition. Cambridge: Harvard UP, 1983. Print.
  • Berman, Harold J. "Toward an Integrative Jurisprudence: Politics, Morality, History." 76 (4) California Law Review (1988): 779-801. Print.
  • Blackstone, Sir William. Commentaries on the Laws of England. Vol. 1. New York: W.E. Dean, 1838. Print.
  • Cicero, De Officis (On Duties). Ed. M.T. Griffin and E.M. Atkins. Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1991. Print.
  • Cicero, De Re Publica (On the Republic) and De Legibus (On the Laws). Trans. C.W. Keyes. Ed. Jeffrey Henderson. Bury St. Edmonds, UK: St. Edmondsbury, 2000. Print.
  • De Bracton, Henry. De Legibus et Consuetudinibus Angliae (On the Laws and Customs of England). Ed. George E. Woodbine. Trans. Samuel E. Thorne. 4 vols. Cambridge: Harvard UP, 1968. Print.
  • Dewey, John. “Context and Thought.” The Later Works of John Dewey. Ed. Jo Ann Boydston. Vol. 6. Carbondale, IL: S. Illinois UP, 1985. Print.
  • Dworkin, Ronald. “The Model of Rules.” U. Chi. L. Rev. 35 (1) (1967): 14-46. Print.
  • Fuller, Lon L. The Morality of Law. New Haven: Yale UP, 1964. Print.
  • Hamilton, Alexander, John Jay, and James Madison. “Federalist No. 63.” The Federalist Papers. Ed. Ernest O'Dell. Sundown, TX: CreateSpace, 2010. Print.
  • Hart, H. L. A. The Concept of Law. 2nd ed. Oxford: Clarendon, 1994. Print.
  • Hart, H. L. A. “Positivism and the Separation of Law and Morals.” Harv. L Rev. 71 (4) (1958): 593–629. Print.
  • Hesiod. Theogony, Works and Days, Shield. Trans. Apostolos N. Athanassakis. 2nd ed. Baltimore: Johns Hopkins Press, 2004. Print.
  • Holmes, Oliver Wendell, Jr. “Natural Law.” Harv. L. Rev. 32 (1) (1918): 40-44. Print.
  • Holmes, Oliver Wendell, Jr. “The Path of the Law.” Harv. L. Rev. 110 (5) (1997): 991-1009. Print.
  • Justinian. Corpus Juris Civilis, The Civil Law. Trans. S.P. Scott. 17 vols. Cincinnati: Central Trust, 1932. Print.
  • Plato. Crito. The Collected Dialogues of Plato, including the Letters. Trans. Lane Cooper. Ed. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. Princeton: Princeton UP, 1961. Print.
  • Plato. Protagoras. The Collected Dialogues of Plato, including the Letters. Trans. Lane Cooper. Ed. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. Princeton: Princeton UP, 1961. Print.
  • Plato. Gorgias. The Collected Dialogues of Plato, including the Letters. Trans. Lane Cooper. Ed. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. Princeton: Princeton UP, 1961. Print.
  • Plato. "Letter VII." The Collected Dialogues of Plato, including the Letters. Trans. Lane Cooper. Ed. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. Princeton: Princeton UP, 1961. Print.
  • Plato. Laws. The Collected Dialogues of Plato, including the Letters. Trans. Lane Cooper. Ed. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. Princeton: Princeton UP, 1961. Print.
  • Plato. Theaetetus. The Collected Dialogues of Plato, including the Letters. Trans. Lane Cooper. Ed. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. Princeton: Princeton UP, 1961. Print.
  • Plato. The Republic. The Collected Dialogues of Plato, including the Letters. Trans. Lane Cooper. Ed. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. Princeton: Princeton UP, 1961. Print.
  • Plutarch. “Themistocles.” Plutarch's Lives. Trans. Bernadotte Perrin. Cambridge: Harvard UP, 1914. Print.
  • Pound, Roscoe. “Mechanical Jurisprudence.” Colum. L. Rev. 8 (3) (1908): 605-623. Print.
  • Radbruch, Gustav. “Five Minutes of Legal Philosophy.” Trans. Bonnie Litschewski Paulson and Stanley L. Paulson. Oxford J. Legal Stud. 26 (1) (2006b): 13-15. Print.
  • Radbruch, Gustav. “Statutory Lawlessness and Supra-Statutory Law.” Trans. Bonnie Litschewski Paulson and Stanley L. Paulson. Oxford J. Legal Stud. 26 (1) (2006a): 1-11. Print.
  • Xenophon. Socrates' Defence. Ed. Robin Waterfield. Trans. Hugh Tredennick and Robin Waterfield. New York: Penguin, 1990. Print.


Author Information

John O. Tyler, Jr.
Houston Baptist University
U. S. A.

Property Concepts

Concepts of property are used to describe the legal and ethical entitlements that particular people or groups have to use to manage particular resources. Beyond that most general definition of 'property' however, philosophical controversy reigns.

Political and legal philosophers disagree on what types of entitlements are essential elements of property, and on the shape and nature of the resultant property entitlements. Indeed, philosophers even disagree on whether it makes sense to talk, in abstraction from a specific legal context, of concepts of property at all. These theoretical controversies are mirrored in practice and law. Cases are determined and conflicts are resolved – or fomented, as the case may be – by the different ideas of property that claimants, judges, legislators and ordinary people recognise and deploy. These controversies are compounded when property concepts are used in application not only to the obvious cases of land and chattels (that is, movable items of property like chairs and cars), but to airspace, airwaves, inventions, information, corporate stock, reputations, fishing rights, brand names, labour, works of art and literature, and more.

Over the last century of political and legal thought, there have been two major – and very different –property-concepts: Bundle Theory and Full Liberal Ownership. Bundle Theory holds that property is a disparate ‘bundle’ of legal entitlements, or ‘sticks’ as they are metaphorically termed. What property a person holds in any given case is determined by the specific entitlements granted by the law to that person. According to Bundle Theory there is no prior idea of property that the law reflects, or that guides the adjudication of cases. The central reason supporting Bundle Theory is the dizzying diversity of property entitlements in law: applying to myriad sorts of resources, regulated in innumerable ways, subject to different sorts of taxation and differing across jurisdictions.

Other theorists, however, have argued that despite the complexity of certain cases of property in law, the idea of property carries genuine content across many contexts and jurisdictions – especially in application to land and chattels. Far from having no substance, the idea of Full Liberal Ownership gave property a detailed and comprehensive meaning: property includes the full gamut of rights to: (a) use the owned resource, (b) exclude others from entering it, and, (c)alienate it (that is, to sell it to someone else).

Yet if Bundle Theory can be faulted as being too nebulous to be correct, some property theorists have argued that Full Liberal Ownership falls into the opposite error, and is too simple and stringent to explain the lived detail of property entitlements. Rejecting both these theories, these theorists have developed diverging accounts of property, arguing that one feature or other – exclusion, use, power, immunity or remedy – is the essential hallmark of property.

This article surveys the major types of contemporary property theories, and the philosophical arguments offered in support of them. The nature of such property concepts carries consequences for the ethical justifications of various property regimes. Several of the more important consequences will be noted in this article, but not pursued in any detail. Readers interested in ethical justifications for property rights should consult the IEP article The Right to Private Property.

Table of Contents

  1. Preliminaries
  2. Bundle Theory
  3. Full Liberal Ownership
  4. The General Idea of Private Property: The Integrated Theory
  5. Exclusion: Trespass-Based Theories
  6. Use: Harm-Based Theories
    1. Overlapping Property: Common and Resource Property Rights
  7. Power-Based Theories: The Question of Alienation
  8. Immunity-Based Theories
  9. Remedy-Based Theories
  10. Examples of Cross-Cutting Theories
    1. Radin and Property for Personhood
    2. Katz and Ownership as Agenda-Setting
  11. Socialist and Egalitarian Property
  12. References and Further Reading

1. Preliminaries

With his characteristic shrewdness, Nietzsche once observed that it is hard to define concepts that have a history. Whatever else may be said of it, property has a history; forms of private property in land date back at least ten millennia, and private property in chattels (movable objects of property like tools and clothes) was present in the Stone Age. With Nietzsche’s point in mind, then, three general remarks on property’s conceptual ambiguities are worth making.

First, the term ‘property’ may refer to the proprietorial entitlements of an owner (Bob has property in that car) or it may refer to the thing that is owned itself (That car is Bob’s property). Lawyers and philosophers tend to be wary of the latter use, primarily because it can distract attention from the significance of the entitlements involved. That is, if we speak about Bob’s car as being his property, then we might be inclined to think that property is all about Bob’s relation to his car, rather than being about the duties everyone owes Bob with respect to his car. If we say that Bob has property in his car, then it is a little clearer that property is about legal and ethical entitlements, and not merely about a physical thing.  That said however, using ‘property’ to refer only to entitlements and not to things carries the danger of forgetting that ordinary people and sometimes even lawmakers may be using the term in its second application (Wenar 1997). With this in mind, this article will use the term in both its meanings; context should at any point make clear which is intended.

Second, property comes in at least three different basic forms: private, collective and common. Private property grants entitlements to a resource to particular individuals, collective property vests them in the state, and common property enfranchises all members of a community. Most contemporary debate on the nature of property surrounds the concept of private property, and this will be the focus of the article. Reflecting this, the term ‘property’ typically will stand for private property, except in the specific sections dealing with common property and collective property (§ 6.1 and §11). Reference to one of these three types of property is often used to characterise types of economic and political regimes. For instance, liberalism may be characterised by private property, socialism by collective property, and certain forms of anarchism and communitarianism by the use of common property. However, it is important to be aware that such characterisations are made on the basis of the predominant form of property in the regime, as no regime relies exclusively on just one form of property. Certain resources seem to be more amenable to one type of property entitlement than another: air as common property, toothbrushes as private property, and artillery as collective property, for example.

Third, actual property entitlements – in law and custom alike – tend to be highly complex, so caution is advisable when philosophical (armchair) theories of property are used to characterise actual property entitlements. The effort to categorize and clarify can distort important features of property that lie within its complexities.

2. Bundle Theory

Bundle Theory is not so much a property-concept as it is the idea that ‘property’ is not really a proper concept at all. Bundle Theory states that there is no pre-existing, well-defined and integrated concept of property that guides – or should guide – our understanding of property-entitlements, or the creation or interpretation of property-entitlements in law. Instead, the law grants specific entitlements of people to things. The property that a person holds in any given instance is simply the sum total of the particular entitlements the law grants to her in that situation. These particular entitlements are metaphorically termed ‘sticks’, and the property that a person holds is thus the particular bundle of sticks the law grants to them in the given instance. Changes to law can alter property entitlements by adding or removing particular sticks from the bundle. Also, several people may have property-entitlements in one resource, as the sticks are spread amongst them, each person with his own bundle. In such cases, Bundle Theory says, it is meaningless to try to determine who the real owner is; each person simply has the entitlements the law grants to them.

There are three main arguments for Bundle Theory. The first argument is conceptual and dates back to Wesley Hohfeld’s path-breaking analysis of rights. Hohfeld (1913) argued that entitlements in law could be broken down into their constituent parts – the basic building-blocks of which more complex legal entitlements are constructed. He termed these basic entitlements ‘jural relations’. In all, Hohfeld described eight jural relations, four of which are important for our purposes here:

Liberty/Privilege: Person A has a liberty to do X with respect to another person B when A has no duty to B not to do X. For example, in an ordinary case Annie will have a liberty (with respect to some other beach-goer Bob) to swim at a public beach if she is not under any duty to Bob not to swim at the beach.

Claim-right: Person A has a claim on another person B to do X when B is under a duty owed to A to perform X. For instance, Annie has a claim-right that Bob not hit her – a claim that correlates with Bob’s duty to refrain from hitting Annie.

Power: Person A has a power over person B with respect to X when A can alter B’s liberties and claim-rights with respect to X. For instance, when Annie alters Bob’s liberties by waiving her claim-right that he not kiss her, she exercises her power to dissolve Bob’s prior duty and so to grant him a liberty. Promising, waiving and selling are all examples of using powers because they all involve the agent in question altering in some way the duties of other people.

Immunity: Person A has an immunity against a person B with respect to X if B cannot alter A’s claims or liberties with respect to X. For instance, if Annie has an immunity against Bob with respect to her freedom of association, then Bob cannot impose new duties on her to refrain from associating (with Charles, say).

Powers and immunities are sometimes called ‘second-order’ jural relations, because they modify or protect first-order jural relations like liberties and claims-rights. For example, when Annie waives (that is, gives up or relinquishes) Bob’s duties not to kiss her, she uses a second-order jural relation (a power) to create in Bob a first-order jural relation (a liberty). As Hohfeld argued, any given right may be broken down into these common denominators – these liberties, claims, immunities and powers. In particular, upon analysis, property may be so divided. Property usually contains some liberties (e.g. to use and possess), some claim-rights (e.g. that others not trespass), some immunities (e.g. that others cannot simply dissolve their duties not to trespass) and some powers (e.g. to sell the owned object). Hohfeld’s analysis demonstrated that property was not as simple an idea as it might first appear. Contrary to popular opinion, property was not a relationship with a thing, but a myriad of jural relations with an indefinite number of other people with respect to a thing. It was not itself a simple entitlement, but rather a consolidated entitlement made up of more simple constituents.

Hohfeld’s analysis did not require adopting the Bundle Theory thesis that there was no integrity or determinate content to the concept of property. One could, as many have since done, hold that property was a specific group of certain sorts of Hohfeldian jural relations. However, Hohfeld’s system laid the conceptual groundwork for Bundle Theory’s stance. Once property could be conceptually dissected into its constituent parts, the door was open for the disintegration of the concept itself. The positive reason for performing such disintegration was supplied by the second argument for Bundle Theory: the complexity of actual proprietorial entitlements in law.

At least by the arrival of the twentieth century, if not much earlier, property entitlements had become enormously complex. Property entitlements were applied to myriad different entities: to airspace, airwaves, inventions, information, fugacious resources (flowing resources like water and oil), riparian land (land bordering rivers), fisheries, wild animals, broadcast rights, mining rights, brand names, labour, works of art and literature, corporate stock, options, reputations, and so on and on. It was difficult to believe that the same cluster of Hohfeldian jural relations were enjoyed by holders of property over all these diverse resources. Furthermore, all of these sorts of property were subject to a wide variety of regulation and taxation measures, all of which might change from country to country, if not state to state. Worse still, many types of property had multiple persons with separate proprietorial entitlements in them; trusts, easements, and common property entitlements all allowed many people to have property in the one resource. While there may have been sense in using a determinate, integrated idea of property in the eighteenth century, it was argued, such a simplistic notion was outmoded (Grey 1980). Faced with the breathtaking variety of existing proprietorial entitlements, the sensible response was to abandon talk of ‘property’ altogether and refer directly to the specific Hohfeldian jural relations – the particular bundle of sticks – held by a given person in a given instance.

The third argument for Bundle Theory’s proposed disintegration of property is an explicitly normative one: that is, it derives from political and ethical theory. Those advocating an integrated idea of property tended to be drawn toward a very strong notion of property: Full Liberal Ownership (see §3 below). This concept of property appeared to leave precious little space for taxation or rates, and so seemed to present a potentially powerful obstacle to the usual schemes for funding basic state institutions, developing public goods, or alleviating poverty. Similarly, Full Liberal Ownership conflicted with state regulation of property, and so opposed environmental limitations on the use of land. With such concerns in mind, some property theorists concluded that any defensible proprietorial entitlements must be fashioned in accord with social justice and environmental commitments, rather than determined by a prior declaration of the essential nature of property (Singer 2000; Freyfogle 2003). Property entitlements are a product of policy and legislation, it was argued, not a conceptual or normative force guiding it. If this is right, then Bundle Theory is a more accurate depiction of the proper nature of property.

For conceptual, descriptive and normative reasons, then, Bundle Theory aimed to disintegrate the concept of property. In its thinking, the state should decide which entitlements to confer on an individual in any given case; that bundle of sticks thereafter constitutes the property that individual holds. There is no prior concept of property determining its bounds.

3. Full Liberal Ownership

If Bundle Theorists had expected the idea of property to fall into disuse however, they were mistaken; the idea of property continued to be invoked in lay, legal and theoretical discourse. Indeed, ordinary people seemed to be able to use their rough-and-ready ideas of property to workably navigate their way through the complex legal world around them. With such considerations as these in mind, philosophers and legal commentators increasingly began to question Bundle Theory’s disintegration of the concept. While the complexity and flexibility of property in some exotic applications could not be questioned, in other more familiar applications it appeared to have an adequate consistency. This was particularly true with respect to chattels like umbrellas, toothbrushes and cars. Far from having no content, it was observed, property entitlements to such objects displayed a profound homogeneity across jurisdictions and political regimes.

Emerging out of this literature, but with countless historical forebears, was a comprehensive concept of property: Full Liberal Ownership. The ringing tones of legal theorist William Blackstone in his 1776 Commentaries on the Laws of England are often used to encapsulate Full Liberal Ownership. In the opening lines of the second book Blackstone declares property to be:

that sole and despotic dominion which one man claims and exercises over the external things of the world, in total exclusion of the right of any other individual in the universe.

Less poetically, but rather more informatively, in 1961 the legal scholar A. M. Honoré set down what he viewed as the eleven ‘standard incidents’ of ownership:

  1. The right to possess: to have exclusive physical control of a thing;
  2. The right to use: to have an exclusive and open-ended capacity to personally use the thing;
  3. The right to manage: to be able to decide who is allowed to use the thing and how they may do so;
  4. The right to the income: to the fruits, rents and profits arising from one’s possession, use and management of the thing;
  5. The right to the capital: to consume, waste or destroy the thing, or parts of it;
  6. The right to security: to have immunity from others being able to take ownership of (expropriating) the thing;
  7. The incident of transmissibility: to transfer the entitlements of ownership to another person (that is, to alienate or sell the thing);
  8. The incident of absence of term: to be entitled to the endurance of the entitlement over time;
  9. The prohibition on harmful use: requiring that the thing may not be used in ways that cause harm to others;
  10. Liability to execution: allowing that the ownership of the thing may be dissolved or transferred in case of debt or insolvency; and,
  11. Residuary character: ensuring that after everyone else’s entitlements to the thing finish (when a lease runs out, for example), the ownership returns to vest in the owner.

With one modification, this list conveys the now popular idea of Full Liberal Ownership. The modification is the rejection by later property theorists of Incident Nine, the prohibition on harmful use. While it is of course agreed that an owner may not use her property in ways that harm others, most theorists see this constraint as a reflection of a prior and ongoing duty all people have not to harm others, and so as not a feature of property per se.

Honoré’s comprehensive listing of these incidents does not in itself confute Bundle Theory. Indeed, as it turned out, Honoré’s list proved a helpful resource for Bundle Theorists; it usefully described the types of sticks that may or may not be present in a proprietor’s bundle. A proprietor may have the incident of income, but not the incident of management, for example, or vice versa. Yet two points can be made about Honoré’s list that do challenge Bundle Theory.

The first point is conceptual: while modifications in many cases may occur, Honoré’s list showed it was possible for there to be a ‘standard case’ of property. His list of incidents was not asserted to be a strict definition of property, demarcating its necessary-and-sufficient conditions. Rather, it outlined the basic features of the concept of property in a manner evocative of Wittgenstein’s idea of ‘family resemblance’. Even if Bundle Theory was right that there was no strict essence of property, the concept nevertheless displayed an array of central characteristics by which it could be recognized and utilized. Furthermore, with this standard set down, other more esoteric types of property could be modeled upon it by analogy.

The second point is the actual existence, in law and custom, of the full complement of Honoré’s property-incidents, in chattels at least, in many places across the globe. As Honoré argued with respect to umbrellas; and others did similarly with respect to automobiles and other moveables, property in such items very often amounts to Full Liberal Ownership. In application to chattels at least, there is – contrary to the claims of Bundle Theory – a striking consistency in the meaning of property.

Even with these two points acknowledged, however, Full Liberal Ownership has seemed to many theorists an overly comprehensive account of private property. While it may be difficult to deny the consistency in proprietorial entitlements over chattels, the problem cases put forward by Bundle Theory remain. Indeed, recent work on common property rights (such as the shared right to hunt a local wood, or fish a local stream) has expanded the array of property cases that struggle to fit the individualist Full Liberal Ownership mould. Likewise, the tension between the requirements of Full Liberal Ownership and political commitments to social justice and environmental sustainability are as relevant as ever. Indeed, the oft-cited declaration of Blackstone above – when set in the context of his famous Commentaries themselves – draws our attention to both the intuitive appeal of Full Liberal Ownership and its surprisingly limited application in the real world in the face of environmental problems and issues of social justice. For as any reader of the Commentaries quickly discovers, Blackstone’s book on property teems with all manner of exotic and overlapping proprietorial rights – in fishing, hunting, travel, foraging, pasturing, recreation and digging for turf or peat. Full Liberal Ownership hardly makes an appearance in the Commentaries even as an ideal type. In the last analysis, then, Full Liberal Ownership seems to be honored more in the breach than in the observance.

Much of the recent work in property theory can be seen as an attempt to navigate between the two poles of Full Liberal Ownership and Bundle Theory, aiming to provide an account that preserves the conceptual integrity of the former while allowing some of the descriptive and normative flexibility of the latter.

There are a variety of theoretical options open to the property theorist attempting such navigation. They may adopt a broader concept of property and then envisage Full Liberal Ownership as one conceptualization (that is, specification) of that larger idea (Waldron 1985). They may adopt a continuum concept of property, where ownership sits as the limit case at the very top of a spectrum of property entitlements, with lesser entitlements located further down the spectrum (Harris 1996). Or they may advance additional concepts of property that sit alongside ownership and aim to cover the cases it is perceived to miss (Breakey 2011). Perhaps the commonest response, however, is simply to relax a strict necessary-and-sufficient-conditions reading of Honoré’s incidents, and consider the usual elements located within the general idea of property.

4. The General Idea of Private Property: The Integrated Theory

Taking a broader perspective than Honoré, many contemporary property theorists accept a three-part approach to property. The general idea of private property, it is held, consists of the following three elements:

Exclusion: others may not enter or use the resource;

Use: the owner is free to use and consume the resource;

Management and Alienation: the owner is free to manage, sell, gift, bequeath or abandon the resource.

On this account, property owners are expected to have some level of each of these three types of entitlements. Full Liberal Ownership will emerge as the limit case of private property, arising when a property-holder has the maximum possible entitlement on the three dimensions of exclusion, use and alienation. Lesser types of property are still possible, provided they contain some threshold amount of these three elements.

This view is thus less absolutist and less comprehensive than Full Liberal Ownership; private property may be regulated or taxed, yet it still displays the signature properties of exclusion, use and alienability—it remains property. Equally though, this concept of property – Integrated Theory, as some have called it – departs from Bundle Theory by viewing property as a consolidated concept (Mossoff 2003). Whether we express property’s entitlements under the three categories of exclusion, use and alienation, or through Hohfeld’s jural relations or Honoré’s incidents, the thought is that its components integrate together to create a united sum that is larger than its parts. Contrary to the claims of Bundle Theory, it is argued, property is a larger, organic whole; the elements of property are not easily detached one from another, and a legal regime cannot simply pick and choose from them at will. Use, exclusion and alienation fit together like three pieces of a puzzle.

In what ways does Integrated Theory hold the elements of property to be conceptually linked? Expressing these conceptual links in terms of Honoré’s incidents, it seems reasonable to think that use includes and requires possession, and that management includes both of these. After all, one cannot manage a property without being able to use it, and one cannot use it without being able to enter it or hold it. Furthermore, income in the form of fruits, rents and profits seems to be a natural result of a property-holder gaining the benefits of possession, use and management respectively (Attas 2007). Likewise, immunities from expropriation are linked to all these incidents. One can’t manage or gain income from a resource if others can simply dissolve all one’s entitlements to it and use it for free.

As such, it is no easy matter for a property bundle on the one hand to include management and on the other to exclude income or immunity. The point may be argued similarly with respect to Hohfeld’s jural relations. While it is, strictly speaking, conceptually possible to distinguish between claim-rights against other’s trespass, liberties of use, and powers of management, it seems fair to say that such relations nevertheless sit very naturally alongside one another. It is difficult to understand what the point would be of having just one of these entitlements without having one or both of the others (Merrill 1998). (This inter-linkage explains, after all, why Hohfeld’s analysis was so groundbreaking, and why law students often struggle to grasp it: ordinary language naturally bunches together the elements that Hohfeld carefully distinguished.) As such, the disintegrated notion of property conjured up by Bundle Theory appears misleading. Analogizing to physics, while it might be true that atoms are made up of protons, neutrons and electrons, this does not mean that it is advisable to try splitting them into these component parts, or that it is possible to reconfigure them in any given alternative arrangement.

Even if it is accepted that there are deep conceptual and practical ties between the elements of property, however, the question may still arise: Which, if any, of the three elements above is the quintessential mark – the essential feature – of property? As the next several sections explain, many property theorists have departed from the Integrated Theory in holding that the essence of property is one or other of the three elements of exclusion, use and alienability – and some property theorists have looked even further afield. The question is not merely a theoretical one. The law often needs to determine whether a given regulation is or is not a violation of the property right – whether it is, for instance, a taking in respect of the Fifth Amendment of the United States Constitution. For such purposes, the question of the essence of property is pivotal. Is it found within exclusion, use, powers of alienation, or some further element?

5. Exclusion: Trespass-Based Theories

As Blackstone’s talk of ‘total exclusion’ suggests, perhaps the most intuitive answer to the question of property’s essence is the right to exclude.

Without question, the notion of exclusion captures an important aspect of most property entitlements: namely, the privileged relationship that one person has (or sometimes a group of people have) to a resource, as compared to other non-property-holders. It is not only the case that the property-holder can prohibit others from engaging with the owned resource, but also that the property-holder is themselves entitled to engage with that resource without requiring the say-so of any other person. The idea of one person excluding others helpfully captures this one-rule-for-me/one-rule-for-everyone-else feature of property entitlements.

Even so, it is important to clarify what is meant by the ‘right to exclude’. In the context of property theory, ‘exclude’ is ambiguous. In the literature it is possible to find the idea of exclusion being applied willy-nilly to very different entities—to resources, activities, values, interests and even to the property right itself (Merrill 1998). Predictably, the term shifts somewhat in meaning in each of these different applications, at times meaning little more than ‘prohibit’, while at others meaning protection from harm, or protection from interference, or protection from trespass or loss in value. These are all distinct notions, and many of them are applicable not only to property rights, but also to many ordinary rights that are not usually spoken of in either proprietorial or exclusionary terms. (Many rights protect a person from harm, for example, but that does not make them property rights.) In shifting from one use of ‘exclude’ to another, it is possible to create a misleading impression that property-entitlements are more consistent across contexts than in fact they are.

The plainest meaning of a ‘right to exclude’, and the one adopted by most Exclusion Theorists, refers to the physical crossing by a person of a physical boundary – it refers, that is, to the idea of trespass. On this footing, it is the essence of property to have a right to exclude others from entering one’s land or possessing one’s chattels – or, to put the point more precisely and technically, it is the essence of property to have a Hohfeldian claim-right constituted by others’ duties to exclude themselves from the resource (Penner 1997). Put more simply, property implies that there is a boundary around the border of the owned entity that non-owners may not cross without the consent of the property-holder.

This does not mean non-owners cannot use or impact upon the resource if they are able to do so without actually entering or possessing it. For instance, the duty to exclude oneself from a garden does not mean that one cannot enjoy looking upon it on one’s way to work. Nor does it mean that one cannot pick up some tips for one’s own gardening endeavours from appreciation of its arrangement. In this respect Exclusion Theory’s focus on physical border-crossing parallels closely the way property-cases are often decided in law. As Lord Camden put it in the eighteenth century, ‘the eye cannot by the laws of England be guilty of a trespass’; that is, one can trespass with one’s feet or with one’s hands, but not merely by looking and listening. Equally however, the focus on border-crossing allows the possibility that a person can impact negatively on another’s property provided one does not enter onto it. For instance, Annie’s pumping out the groundwater on her property may cause Bob’s land to collapse, but Annie has not breached any duty to exclude herself from physically entering Bob’s property. The law on such questions tends to be more equivocal—in some jurisdictions it will determine that Annie’s action violated Bob’s property-right, but in other jurisdictions it will not. Even still, it is unquestionably true that harms which involve physical trespass are treated in law very differently, and usually more harshly, than harms which do not. As such, Exclusion Theory rightly directs attention to property’s allocation of specific resources to specific individuals, and the usefulness of physical encroachment as a trigger for legal action.

Several critiques may be made of Exclusion Theory. On a theoretical and normative level, some have argued that the focus on exclusion deflects attention from the way exclusion integrates with the more fundamental idea of use (Mossoff 2003). In a sense, Exclusion Theory can be thought of as a theory of non-ownership: it focuses on what property means for those who do not have it, rather than for those who do (Katz 2008). Equally though, a defender of the theory may argue that Exclusion Theory rightly places attention on the element of property that most cries out for justification—its imposition of constraining duties on everyone but the property-holder. In this respect, it is arguable that Exclusion Theory helpfully expresses a widespread and important moral norm of inviolability – the idea that some things are off-limits to people (Balgandesh 2008).

On a descriptive level, the question may be raised whether the right to exclude accurately captures the idea of property at work in applications outside the simple cases of land and chattels. This is particularly true with respect to property over intangibles, including intellectual property rights like copyright and patent, which grant entitlements over created artistic works and inventions. In such cases, Exclusion Theory’s usual reliance on the natural boundaries of the thing (the physical borders of the chattel or the land) and the notion of physical crossing apply less straightforwardly, and much controversy surrounds whether the theory manages to account for these sorts of intellectual properties. Even in application to real property, however, there are entitlements that Exclusion Theory can struggle to explain. For instance, exclusion does not seem to be a primary element of property in cases where multiple persons have overlapping properties in the one resource. Plainly, none of them can exclude each other, yet they all seem to have property.

6. Use: Harm-Based Theories

Rather than focusing on exclusion, attention may be directed at property’s capacity to protect particular uses of, and activities performed upon, a given resource. On this perspective – which might be termed Harm Theory – the essence of a property-right in some resource is not to prohibit others from trespassing across the resource’s boundaries, but instead to prohibit others from harming certain of the property-holder’s uses of the resource. These protected uses may in some cases be very specific, as occurs with fishing rights or mining rights. Or the protected uses may include a wide cluster of activities—for instance as may be gathered under the idea of protecting an owner’s quiet enjoyment of his land. The ancient property law of sic utere tuo (use your own so as to do no harm to others) may be invoked here: rather than Annie simply respecting the boundaries of Bob’s land by not crossing them, she is required to ensure that her use of her property does not harm Bob’s use of his (Freyfogle 2003). Rather than trespass, the focus shifts to notions of harm, nuisance, interference and worsening. To be sure, these concepts will often overlap with trespass, but they are not identical. There are many cases where protection of an activity from harm or interference will not require – or will require more than – rules against crossing a physical boundary.

In this respect, Harm Theory differs on practical matters from Exclusion Theory in two sets of cases. First, it will not consider boundary-crossing to be a necessary violation of the property right. The question, rather, will be whether the boundary crossing was in some sense harmful to the property-holder, given the use or set of uses to which that property holder is putting the property. If the boundary-crossing was not detrimental to the property-holder’s project, then there is ‘no-harm, no-foul’. In this first case, the duties imposed by Harm Theory are less extensive than Exclusion Theory, as some cases of boundary-crossing will not be violations of the right. Second, however, the Harm Approach will protect the earmarked uses even from the harmful actions of others who do not cross the property-boundary. As such, Annie pumping out groundwater that causes Bob’s property to collapse, or Annie building structures that block sunlight from Bob’s solar array, or Annie blocking access-ways to Bob’s property, or Annie flooding Bob’s property by damming the creek on Annie’s property, may all be violations of Bob’s property rights. In this second set of cases, the duties imposed by Harm Theory are more extensive than those created by Exclusion Theory, as they reach out to affect others operating outside the property’s borders.

Descriptively, Harm Theory can account for the many cases of apparent trespass – boundary-crossing even against the explicit will of the property-holder – that are not held to be legal violations of the property right because they were not deemed to be harmful to the property-holder’s activities (Katz 2008). In response however, the Exclusion Theorist can marshal example cases in law where trespass was prioritized over harm, and it is not easy to perceive a clear victor in this debate. However, the Harm Theorist does have one, perhaps not-so-minor, area where their account is clearly descriptively superior; this is in respect of overlapping property rights.

a. Overlapping Property: Common and Resource Property Rights

Rights to a common resource – where everyone in a given community can use the resource – come in a variety of different forms. Two are worth considering here. First, there are open access regimes, where all persons can access the resource and either: a) there are no constraints on what they may do on or with that resource, or, b) there are constraints, but these constraints allow space for people to worsen the resource in respect of the uses they and others put the resource to. Fisheries are often examples of open access regimes; everyone in the community may have the right to access and to fish in the local lake, but their unrestrained fishing ultimately impacts detrimentally on the capacity of the lake to provide fish. As Garret Hardin famously showed in The Tragedy of the Commons, in such a situation rational agents may be expected to exploit the resource to the detriment of everyone (Hardin 1968).

In at least some cases, however, communities are able to develop constraints on each person’s uses of the resource so as to ensure the resource sustains its capacity for the specified uses over long periods of time (Ostrom 1990). Sometimes these systems may be quite simple, such as the rules that determine how parks, beaches and wildlife-reserves operate, allowing all citizens access and enjoyment without destroying the resource for others. When a common resource factors in production, however, a heavier toll is taken on the resource, and more sophisticated systems are usually required to ensure its sustainability. For instance, a community may adopt a ‘wintering rule’ with respect to pasturing their cows on a commons, such that no member can pasture more cows during the summer than they can feed off their own supplies through the winter. By capping herd-numbers in this way, the commons can be protected from over-exploitation. These sort of constraints may be thought of as protecting certain uses from the harmful acts of others, and so as a species of harm-based property entitlements. One recent account of such entitlements understands common property as ‘property-protected activities’ occurring on specific tethered resources. Such property-protection includes four types of property incidents: (i) the entitlement of the property-holder to access the resource, (ii) the entitlement to use the resource for the specific activity in question (e.g. fishing, foraging), (iii) the ownership of the fruits or profits of that activity, and (iv) the claim-rights over other users that they do not worsen (harm) the resource in respect of the specific property-protected activity (Breakey 2011).

Such harm-based accounts also aim to explain the many cases of multiple property entitlements in a single resource where such overlapping entitlements are not spread across the entire community. For example, one family in a community may have foraging rights for fruit in a local common, several families may have hunting rights, and everyone in the community may have the right to gather firewood. So long as there are effective constraints on each activity ensuring that it does not harm the others, the regime is not one of open-access, but a species of property. Again, Harm Theory can make sense of these properties by focusing not on trespass over physical boundaries (as Exclusion Theory does) but rather on the ongoing protection of certain specific uses of the tethered resource.

Normatively, one of the advantages of Harm Theory is that it tightly links the concept of property to some of the more popular ethical justifications for property rights. For instance, if property is intended to be justified because it allows people to do things—to perform ongoing productive or preserving projects over time, and to more generally reap the consequences of their actions, then one might think that the primary focus should be on protecting those projects from harm. As such, protecting people’s labour (with John Locke) or their expectations about the fruits of their labour (with Jeremy Bentham) brings harm, and not exclusion, to the foreground.

Inevitably however, Harm Theory invites its own particular critiques. First, the legal protection of some uses and not others makes Harm Theories of property explicitly political in a way that Exclusion Theory for the most part avoids. On the Harm Theory, property is not neutral among the different acts property-holders might want to perform, but necessarily selects amongst them. Exclusion Theory, on the other hand, merely sets up boundaries and lets owners decide what to do within them. Second, this privileging of use threatens to derail the idea (and enormous practical utility, in terms of information costs) of property as an integrated concept consistent across contexts; a ‘bundle of uses’ may be little improvement on a ‘bundle of entitlements’ (Merrill and Smith 2001). Third, and perhaps most seriously, the fixed and specific uses (or sets of uses) that property-holders are entitled to engage in seems to depart from a very basic and intuitive thought about private property, which is that it is for the owner to decide what will happen on their property, and that their choices on this matter are to some extent genuinely open-ended. Harm Theory delimits which acts will be property-protected, and so constrains – in some cases very considerably – a property-holder’s capacity to determine what will happen on the property. As such, it may be that Harm Theory can only augment, but cannot hope to replace, rival theories of property like Exclusion Theory.

Ultimately it may be that property should be best understood as a mix of the Exclusion and Harm Theories, whereby both trespass and harm should be factored into our larger concept of property. One obvious reason for adopting this sort of mixed theory is that protecting against trespass often will be the most effective way of protecting against harm; it is far easier to detect trespassers than harmers (Ellickson 1993). This mixed view is also reflected in much legal case-law, where notions of trespass and boundary (from Exclusion Theory) interweave amongst notions of nuisance, quiet enjoyment and do-no-harm (from Harm Theory). If this combination of the two theories is correct, however, this would be an important conceptual result, because it introduces a tension into the very heart of property (Singer 2000; Freyfogle 2003). It means that in at least some cases we cannot know a priori (that is, simply from application of the concept of property) whether a property-holder or a non-property holder is entitled to perform a particular act until we settle the question of what uses are being protected from harm, what happens when two protected uses clash, and whether harm will trump trespass in this particular case.

7. Power-Based Theories: The Question of Alienation

The two theories just covered – Exclusion and Harm – share a common focus on what are called ‘first-order Hohfeldian jural relations’ (see §2 above). In particular, their dispute surrounds which types of claim-rights are held by property-owners, where the choice is between claim-rights prohibiting others from trespassing, or claim-rights prohibiting others from harming. But it is arguable that this dispute misplaces altogether the unique nature of property in terms of its second-order Hohfeldian jural relations, especially ‘powers’ (the capacity to alter others’ claim-rights with respect to the owned resource).

It has long been held by political philosophers of very different stripes that it is the quintessential mark of property that it can be traded in a marketplace. Courts of law have made similar judgments, recognizing an entitlement as property once it is established that the entitlement is tradable. Such rights of trade – as well as associated powers of waiver, management and abandonment – are second-order Hohfeldian powers, allowing an owner to alter the normative standing of others with respect to the resource. On the Power Theory, as it might be termed, to know whether a particular right is property, the decisive question to ask is whether it can be traded for money; Annie’s property essentially involves Annie having the power to altogether transfer (alienate) her rights over the resource to Bob, so that Bob becomes the property-holder, and Annie loses her property-rights with respect to that resource. Moreover, Annie can perform this alienation on condition of a like alienation by Bob, such that they trade property, or exchange property for money. On this view, an item of property is necessarily tradable, and so necessarily a commodity. As such, if a society has property rights then it necessarily has to some extent a market economy (at least with respect to those objects over which property is held).

While many theorists and laypeople view the relationship between property and commodity as simply intuitive, others mount arguments aiming to tie the two together theoretically. For instance, it may be argued that accounts of property need to pay heed to the fact that Bob’s duties with respect to Annie’s property are owed to Annie and not to society at large, and that allowing Annie to alienate those duties as she sees fit is a necessary implication of the fact that the duties are owed to her (Dorfman 2010). This line of thought on property rights may be bolstered by appeal to the ‘will/choice theory of rights,’ which holds that it is of the essence of rights more generally to be waivable and transferable (Steiner 1994). If the power to make choices over the duties others owe to us is an essential feature of rights in general, then it is plausible to think that it will also be a feature of property rights more particularly.

Against this proposed assimilation of property with commodity, however, many property theorists have argued that the essence of property need not include full powers of alienation and that there are attractive, integrated concepts of property without this element. Examples of property concepts explicitly avoiding alienation include the idea of personal property—familiar from both socialist theory and practice. Personal property may be characterized as property that cannot be sold, but which can be licensed out (Radin 1982). Other subtle variations are possible, allowing some forms of alienation and waiver, but not others. For instance, it has been argued that the concept of property necessarily allows for bequeathal and gift but does not necessarily include the power of sale. On this view, a property-holder can always give away her property or leave it to her children; to sell the property, however, requires the additional concept of contract (Penner 1997). Another variation holds that the concept of property includes the capacity for certain types of trade, but not the entitlement to receive income from managing the property (Christman 1991). A further variation again – one common in both law and custom – is the ‘classic usufruct’, where the property is held until the death of the property-holder, but cannot be transferred during their lifetime (Ellickson 1993).

One challenge arising for such accounts is that it is hard to draw a conceptual line in the sand between the types of Hohfeldian powers a property-holder does and does not have. Almost everyone will agree, for instance, that property-rights include the power of waiver – that is, that Annie is able to consent to Bob entering her land by waiving Bob’s duties of non-trespass. But it can be difficult to see how Annie can have a power of waiver without thereby having the power to manage; the capacity to consent to another person’s entry onto the property under stipulated conditions effectively allows the property-holder to manage what happens on the property. But from there, it is difficult to see how Annie can have the power of management without also having rights to income, as she can make one of the stipulated conditions for Bob’s entry onto the property that she receives some of what Bob produces. Similarly, it can be difficult to draw a strong distinction between Annie being able to give away her property at her discretion, and her being able to transfer it for money.

To be sure, this difficulty in specifying exactly which Hohfeldian powers of transfer are essential incidents of property is not impossible to overcome—and certainly neither law nor custom has any problem allowing some powers of transfer and prohibiting others (Ellickson 1993). But the existence of the difficulty does suggest that all these powers sit on a continuum, and that when crafting an integrated, coherent property-concept, the absence of a clear distinction between these powers at any given point has led different theorists to draw the line in quite different – and sometimes enormously subtle – places. Perhaps all this difficulty implies is that when seeking integrated property concepts, the conceptual linkages between Honoré’s incidents and between Hohfeld’s jural relations mean that such categories should not be relied upon to provide the desired boundaries. With this in mind, §10 below describes two theories of property that cut across the dimensions described by Honoré’s and Hohfeld’s systems. Alternatively, another response is to make property’s powers a continuum concept. An example of this idea is J. W. Harris’ theory of property (Harris 1996). For Harris, property has two necessary elements: trespassory rules (familiar from the Exclusion Theory described above in §5) and the ownership spectrum. The ownership spectrum is a continuum ranging from personal use-privileges to control-powers allowing management and – at the very top of the spectrum – full alienation. Harris is then able to specify distinct types of property – half property, mere-property, and full-blooded ownership – as residing at distinct points on this ownership spectrum.

8. Immunity-Based Theories

An additional type of second-order Hohfelidan jural relation is implicated in property. Rather than focusing concern on how Annie can alter others’ duties with respect to the property (the question of powers), attention may be turned to the manner in which Annie is protected from having her standing with respect to the property altered by others (the question of immunity).

Some degree of immunity is an essential element of property. If Annie has an entitlement to a resource that can be dissolved merely by Bob’s say-so, then it seems fair to say that Annie does not have property in that resource, but only some lesser entitlement. More specifically, if Annie holds property over Blackacre, then her neighbor Bob cannot, without Annie’s consent, transfer the ownership of Blackacre to himself; Bob cannot expropriate Blackacre. As such, some degree of immunity from the non-consensual dissolution of a property-holder’s entitlements over her owned resource appears to be a necessary condition of property.

Interestingly, the seventeenth century political philosopher John Locke took seriously the possibility that an immunity from expropriation was a sufficient condition for property. He thought that any entitlement that could not be removed by others counted as property, defining property as ‘that without a man’s own consent it cannot be taken from him.’ Such a position accounts for the very wide concept of property that Locke used at various points throughout his famous Two Treatises on Government. Since many ordinary rights (such as to free speech and bodily security) are immunized from others’ dissolution, advancing such an immunity as a sufficient condition of property means that property encompasses all natural or human rights. This perhaps seems to a modern eye to explode rather than inform the concept of property.

Even making an immunity from expropriation only a necessary condition of property is controversial however, as it seems to imply that much (perhaps all) takings or taxation by the government necessarily impinges on property. Clearly, there are significant consequences at stake here for distributive justice, as taxation in market economies is the primary source of funds for state welfare, education and healthcare. For this reason, various attempts have been made to define integrated property concepts so as to leave space for taxation. For instance, one approach grants immunity against expropriation so long as the property-holder is engaging purely with their own property, but weakens that immunity when the property-holder starts to derive market income through management or sale of the property (Christman 1991). Such an approach ties the question of immunity to the question of transfer and alienation discussed in the previous section (§7). Against such attempts, it has been argued that all concepts of property allowing the possibility of non-consensual expropriation necessarily have a strained sense about them, as they artificially try to make the concept of property compatible with its own extinction (Attas 2007). On this view, while various regulations of property may be consistent with the idea of property, expropriation itself cannot be a part of the concept. If we are committed to taxation, it is argued, property’s essential tie to immunity from expropriation means we must entirely forgo property as an organizing idea for our economic and political systems.

9. Remedy-Based Theories

Previous sections have located the essence of property in first-order Hohfeldian claim-rights (claim-rights prohibiting exclusion and harm) and second-order Hohfeldian jural relations (powers of transfer and immunity from expropriation). But there is one further dimension on which property may be characterized: remedies—the question of what is done when the rules of property are broken.

An influential theory developed by legal scholars Calabresi and Melamed distinguishes property-rules from liability-rules and inalienability-rules (Calabresi and Melamed 1972). Property-rules are those entitlements that may only be removed with the consent of the rights-holder; the rights-holder gets to name the conditions under which they consent to extinguish the entitlements that would otherwise apply. Liability-rules, on the other hand, allow entitlements to be removed by a party so long as that party pays a specific cost. This cost is objectively determined by the state, and not by the subjective choice of the entitlement-holder. Inalienability-rules prevent entitlements being removed or transferred at all; if an entitlement is inalienable then even the right-holder herself cannot waive or alienate the entitlement. Different rules can apply to the same resource in different contexts. For instance, a person’s home is usually protected by property-rules with respect to other citizens (who, if they want to buy, must meet the owner’s asking price) but is only protected by liability-rules with respect to the state (as the state can use its powers of eminent domain to remove the entitlements in return for an objectively determined payment to the homeowner). Calabresi and Melamed’s distinction has relevance to the issues of immunities and powers discussed in the last two sections (§7-8). With respect to powers it implies that entitlements protected by inalienability-rules are not property, and thus that property implies alienability; and that entitlements protected only by a liability-rule are not property. With respect to immunities, the use of property-rules rather than liability-rules implies that property includes an immunity from forced transfer (by ordinary citizens, at least) through payment of an objectively determined sum.

Additionally though, Calabresi and Melamed’s analysis applies to remedies: the question of what happens when the initial rules (whatever they are) are broken. Imagine Bob illicitly breaches Annie’s property rights in X by taking X. However, upon being caught Bob gets to keep X, and only has to pay Annie a (non-punitive) objectively determined estimation of the cost of X. While the letter of the law may say that Bob has a duty to exclude himself from taking Annie’s property, in reality Bob can take what he wants from Annie and then simply pay the cost for that item as determined by the state. In such a case it may be doubted whether Annie really has a property right at all. Similarly, if Bob is found to be engaged in an ongoing breach of Annie’s property rights, it may seem obvious that a court will order Bob to stop his ongoing violation (this is called ordering  an injunction or injunctive relief), rather than merely imposing an objectively-determined cost of damages upon Bob and letting him continue the violation. But appearances can be deceiving. If Bob accidentally built his house on some of Annie’s land, the court may award damages to Annie but not force Bob to remove his transgressing building—and there are other cases where property-violations are not automatically granted injunctive relief (Balgandesh 2008). Ultimately, then, while there is clearly some conceptual relationship between property rights and the types of remedies that are to be applied if and when those rights are violated, precisely what that relationship amounts to is controversial. Perhaps the most that can be said with confidence is that property remedies, reflective of the fact that property’s duties are owed to the property-holder, must be a part of private law as well as public law, and so must in principle allow owners to seek damages over violations of their property rights, as well as allowing the state to perform criminal sanctions on the person who violated those rights (Dorfman 2010).

10. Examples of Cross-Cutting Theories

The foregoing five sections have described theories focusing in turn on one particular dimension of property: claim-rights, powers, immunities or remedies. It may be, however, that the best theory of property will be one that cuts across these dimensions and carries implications for all of them. Two examples of such cross-cutting theories follow.

a. Radin and Property for Personhood

In her influential 1982 article Property and Personhood Margaret Radin does not aim to provide a general theory of property, but seeks instead to explore one specific type of property relationship: the personality theory of property. This theory describes the specific cases where property comes to be, in a deep philosophical sense, a part of the person who owns it. Arising through the significance of things in constituting our memories, our actions, our individuality and our continuing plans and expectations, this type of deep attachment between person and thing (consider wedding rings and other items with sentimental value) gives rise to a theory of property-for-personhood with implications for each of the dimensions listed above.

In terms of claim-rights, the inviolability and sanctity of property-for-personhood implies the centrality of rights of exclusion from the object itself. It is important that nameless others do not access and use the personal object, rather than merely prohibiting their harming it in some fashion. Turning to powers, as part of the owner’s person, personal property is not a commodity; it is precisely the definition of personal property that it is not freely exchangeable for functional equivalents or for its market price. While this does not automatically mean alienation should be legally prohibited for such items (an object can shift over time from one category to another, so implementing such a rule would be difficult), it is at least clear that powers of alienation are not an essential part of the entitlements of property-for-personhood. In terms of immunities and remedies, property-for-personhood warrants the stronger protection of Calabresi and Melamed’s property-rule rather than the lesser protection afforded by a mere liability-rule. Other citizens – and perhaps even the state – should not be able to expropriate parts of a property-holder’s very person. Reflective of this, courts would be expected to utilize injunctive relief (that is, they would order the defendant cease the violating behaviour) as remedies in the case of a continuing violation of property-for-personhood, rather than merely awarding damages. In this way, the implications of a specific concept of property can be traced as they cut across the several dimensions described above.

b. Katz and Ownership as Agenda-Setting

Recently, Larissa Katz has advanced an agenda-setting theory of property in land, whereby the property-owner has the supreme power to set the agenda for the property (Katz 2008). This theory can be viewed as a sophisticated combination of a Harm Theory and a Power Theory. The theory says that a property owner can exclusively choose what particular type of act they will perform on the property – for instance, they may adopt residential, agricultural, or various sorts of industrial uses of their land. This is no mere liberty of action however—with the performance of these different activities, the owner sets the agenda for the property, shaping the duties of others with respect to that property. Non-owners have different clusters of duties imposed upon them depending upon the activity that has been undertaken by the owner; they must accord their behaviour, vis-à-vis the resource, with the agenda that has been set. As such, the agenda-setting capacity is a Hohfeldian power that alters the duties of non-owners with respect to the resource. Once the agenda is set through the owner’s chosen activities, the ensuing entitlements are thereafter modeled by the Harm Theory; others may be allowed to cross the boundaries of the property in a variety of contexts, but in doing so they must ensure their actions do not impact upon the specific activity that the owner is performing. The agenda, but not the thing, shapes the duties of others, and harm, but not exclusion, is prioritized.

11. Socialist and Egalitarian Property

Much of the foregoing has considered different theories of private property—with the exception being the universal endowments of common property discussed in §6.1. But it may be enquired what sort of property concepts arise from socialist theory and practice. Naturally, there are many different answers to this question, particularly if its scope is expanded to include, say, contemporary theories of market socialism (which aim to assimilate socialist theories of justice with elements of market-based economies), the types of property relationships that were expected to emerge during the transition from capitalism to socialism, and the various types of property existing in law and de facto in particular socialist regimes throughout recent history. In the main, however, two answers predominate.

At least since the beginning of the twentieth century, socialism has been identified with the public ownership of the means of production. This directly implies the collective ownership of those assets playing a role in production. Equally though, it leaves room for each person to hold property – even private property – in particular resources, provided these entitlements do not allow for private production to occur. With this restriction in mind, concepts of private property available for use in socialist regimes will exclude market transfers, with the intention of facilitating the elements of property that allow personal use, and prohibiting those that allow control over other persons. Individual citizens thus will be entitled to personal property (§7) and to property-for-personhood as Radin defined that term (§10.1), and they may also have common property in certain public amenities.

As well as the non-productive property entitlements of individual persons, the defining feature of a socialist economy is that productive resources are collectively owned. There are three features of such ownership. First, the group as a whole, or some subset understood to be representative of that whole, determines the use to which a resource will be put and manages the resource. Second, decisions on how the resource will be used are made through reference to the collective interest; the property is to be managed in order to produce what the collective requires. Third, the property’s management must also instantiate the proper empowerment of those citizens who labour upon it; workers must not be alienated from their labour even for the sake of public benefit elsewhere.

Naturally, this general characterization may be filled out in very different ways, depending upon who represents the collective, how centralized their decision-making is, how the collective’s interests are defined, what counts as proper empowerment, how the relationship between collective and personal property is managed, and so on (Kulikov 1988). Cooperative property and to an extent some of the property systems of communes may be understood as collective property writ on a smaller scale—being held by small communities and working groups rather than entire nation-states. More decentralized socialist regimes have made extensive use of this form of productive arrangement.

There is one further property-concept worth noting here: joint ownership. A resource is jointly-owned when each member of a community has a veto-right over what may be done or produced on the resource; no production is allowed without the prior agreement of every member. This concept of property is rarely found in law or custom. Its most common use is as a theoretical device for modeling an initial normative relation between people and land (Cohen 1995). In this way joint ownership sets down an imagined initial situation where no productive action can occur without the agreement of every joint owner. This standpoint then serves as a conceptual point of departure from which further contracting can occur. There are good reasons for thinking that the property-entitlements arising from such contracting will be highly egalitarian, as the veto-power joint ownership gives each member of the society will allow them to bargain for a share of whatever is produced.

12. References and Further Reading

Bundle Theory and the Disintegration of Property

  • Hohfeld, W. “Fundamental Legal Conceptions as Applied in Judicial Reasoning.” Yale Law Journal 23 (1913): 16-59; (Contined in YLJ 26, 1917: 710-69.)
    • Landmark pair of articles analysing rights (including property rights) into constituent parts.
  • Cohen, Felix. “Transcendental Nonsense and the Functional Approach.” Columbia Law Review 35.6 (1935): 809-49.
    • Advocates a scientific and functional approach to law; argues the concept of property (among others) to be an unwanted supernatural entity.
  • Grey, Thomas. “The Disintegration of Property.” Property: Nomos XXII. Eds. Pennock, J. Roland and J. W. Chapman. New York: New York University Press, 1980. 69-86.
    • Influential argument against integrated concepts of property.
  • Merrill, Thomas, and Henry Smith. “What Happened to Property in Law and Economics?” Yale Law Journal 111 (2001): 357-98.
    • Illustrates why Coase-inspired property theorists gravitated toward the Bundle (and also use/harm) approach; argues this approach obscures crucial features of property.

Full Liberal Ownership

  • Honoré, A. “Ownership.” Oxford Essays in Jurisprudence. Ed. Guest, A. London: Oxford University Press, 1961. 107-47.
    • Seminal article listing eleven incidents of Full Liberal Ownership (often used as a comprehensive list of the potential sticks in property’s bundle).
  • Epstein, Richard. Takings: Private Property and the Power of Eminent Domain. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1985.
    • Influential libertarian reading of the US Takings Clause through the Hohfeldian lens; argues the dissolution of any incident of property is a taking of property.

Integrated Theory

  • Mossoff, Adam. “What Is Property?” Arizona Law Review 45 (2003): 371-443.
    • Sustained argument for Integrated Theory, including its historical pedigree from the early modern period in Grotius and Locke.

Exclusion Theories

  • Balgandesh, Shyamkrishna. “Demystifying the Right to Exclude: Of Property, Inviolability and Automatic Injunctions.” Harvard Journal of Law and Public Policy 31 (2008): 593-661.
    • Argues that property is based on a principle of inviolability, and so constituted by claim-rights that others exclude themselves. Argues against remedy-based property theories like Calabresi and Melamed’s.
  • Merrill, Thomas. “Property and the Right to Exclude.” Nebraska Law Review 77 (1998): 730-55.
    • Argues the essence of property is the right to exclude, from which the other aspects of property can be derived.
  • Penner, J. The Idea of Property in Law. Oxford: Clarendon, 1997.
    • Classic statement of exclusion theory; property includes powers of abandonment and gift, but not alienation, which requires the addition of the concept of contract in law.

Harm-Based Theories, including Common Property

  • Ostrom, Elinor. Governing the Commons: The Evolution of Institutions for Collective Action. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1990.
    • Influential study of common property, describing its diversity, nature, history and variable capacity to resist tragedy.
  • Breakey, Hugh. “Two Concepts of Property: Ownership of Things and Property in Activities.” The Philosophical Forum 42.3 (2011): 239-65.
    • Argues that a (Harm-based) concept of property-protected activities solves problem cases (common property, resource property, property in labour, etc.) encountered by Exclusion Theory.
  • Hardin, Garrett. “The Tragedy of the Commons.” Science 162 (1968): 1243-48.
    • Landmark article describing how rational actors degrade common (read open-access) resources.

Environmental and Community-Based Conceptions of Property

  • Freyfogle, Eric. The Land We Share. London: Shearwater Books, 2003.
    • Describes the fluidty and diversity of property-entitlements through US history, and their responsiveness to community and ecological needs; emphasizes internal tensions within property entitlements.
  • Singer, Joseph. Entitlement. London: Yale University Press, 2000.
    • Argues control over a property should be delineated by individuals’ protected interests in that property, rather than by abstract notions of ownership; marshals an array of tensions within ownership.

Power-Based Theory

  • Dorfman, Avihay. “Private Ownership.” Legal Theory 16 (2010): 1-35.
    • Identifies property with the capacity to alter others’ normative standing with respect to the resource. Links this feature with property’s status in private law.
  • Christman, John. “Self-Ownership, Equality, and the Structure of Property Rights.” Political Theory 19.1 (1991): 28-46.
    • Distinguishes property’s ‘use’ rights (including alienation) from its ‘control’ rights (especially income), and argues for the ethical priority of the former.
  • Steiner, Hillel. An Essay on Rights. Oxford: Blackwell, 1994.
    • Links Will/Choice theory of rights to property entitlements in developing a left-libertarian position.

Immunity-Based Theory

  • Attas, Daniel. “Fragmenting Property.” Law and Philosophy 25.1 (2007): 119-49.
    • Describes structural relations between Honore’s property-incidents; argues immunity from expropriation is a necessary incident of property.

Remedy-Based Theory

  • Calabresi, G., and D. Melamed. “Property Rule, Liability Rules and Inalienability: One View of the Cathedral.” Harvard Law Review 85 (1972): 1089-1128.
    • Focusing on remedies and immunities, distinguishes property-rules, inalienability-rules and liability-rules.

Cross-Cutting Theories

  • Katz, Larissa. “Exclusion and Exclusivity in Property Law.” University of Toronto Law Journal 58.3 (2008): 275-315.
    • ‘Agenda-setting’ theory of property: property’s duties are not set by exclusion from the resource, but rather shaped to conform with the agenda the owner has set for the resource.
  • Radin, Margaret. “Property and Personhood.” Stanford Law Review 34 (1982): 957-1015.
    • Definitive account of the personhood theory of property; investigates the special case where property forms part of the person of the property-holder.

Socialist Property

  • Kulikov, V. V. “The Structure and Forms of Socialist Property.” Problems of Economics 31.1 (1988): 14-29.
    • Details the two major forms of property applicable to socialist regimes (collective and personal property) and their inter-relation. Considers the use of personal private production in Soviet socialism.
  • Cohen, Gerald. Self-Ownership, Freedom and Equality. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • Searching investigation of normative implications of different property regimes. Chapter  4 describes ‘Joint Ownership’.

General Literature

  • Ellickson, Robert. “Property in Land.” Yale Law Journal 102 (1993): 1315-400.
    • Detailed analysis of the complexities of property in land, combining historical cases and rational-actor theory, and considering private, common, and communal property-arrangements.
  • Wenar, Leif. “The Concept of Property and the Takings Clause.” Columbia Law Review 97 (1997): 1923-46.
    • Argues, with special reference to the US takings clause, that property should be viewed as the thing that is the object of (Hohfeldian) property rights.
  • Harris, James. Property and Justice. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
    • Property based on twin notions of trespassory rules and the ‘ownership spectrum’, a continuum ranging from mere use-privileges through to control-powers and alienation.
  • Waldron, Jeremy. “What Is Private Property?” Oxford Journal of Legal Studies 5 (1985): 313-49.
    • Sustained argument against property skepticism; private property is a broad concept (that resources are allocated to particular individuals, who determine their use) of which particular conceptions are possible. Considers common and collective property.
  • Locke, John. Two Treatises of Government. New York: Hafner, 1947 (1689).
    • Perhaps the most influential treatise on property ever penned, though subject to divergent interpretations. As well as the famous Chapter Five of the Second Treatise, see First Treatise sections 39-41, 86-92 and Second Treatise sections 135-40, 159, 172-74.
  • Macpherson, C. B., ed. Property: Mainstream and Critical Positions. Toronto: University of Toronto, 1978.
    • Useful anthology of major property theorists throughout history, and more recent critical arguments.


Author Information

Hugh Breakey
Griffith University

Law and Economics

The law and economics movement applies economic theory and method to the practice of law. It asserts that the tools of economic reasoning offer the best possibility for justified and consistent legal practice. It is arguably one of the dominant theories of jurisprudence. The law and economics movement offers a general theory of law as well as conceptual tools for the clarification and improvement of its practices. The general theory is that law is best viewed as a social tool that promotes economic efficiency, that economic  analysis and efficiency as an ideal can guide legal practice.  It also considers how legislation should be used to improve market conditions  in return. Law and economics offers a framework with which to model legal outcomes, and common objectives with which to unify disparate areas of legal activity. The bringing together of legal theory and economic reasoning has also created new research agendas in the fields of behavioral economics: how rationality affects people's behavior within legal scenarios; public choice theory and how collective behavior should have an effect on legislation; and game theory: understanding strategic action in a legal context.

Table of Contents

  1. Law as an Autonomous Practice
  2. Law as a Tool to Encourage Economic Efficiency
    1. Basic Concepts in Economic Reasoning
    2. How Law Can Encourage Economic Efficiency
    3. Can All Law be Explained as Economic in Nature?
  3. Economics and Normative Jurisprudence
  4. Later Developments
    1. Behavioral Economics and Law
    2. Game Theory
    3. Public Choice Theory
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Law as an Autonomous Practice

Most traditional theories of jurisprudence look to uncover the essential or definitive aspects of the institution of law. Two of the most influential are Legal Positivism and Dworkin’s Law as Integrity. While these two differ as to their definition of law and legal reasoning, they agree upon some basic central assumptions, determining the conclusions that two philosophical investigations with largely the same aims, can reach. Because of this it is important to acknowledge some of the assumptions that are held in common by these jurisprudential stances.

First, both theories agree upon the conceptual nature of jurisprudence. Both agree that it is important for a philosophical theory of law to define the core aspects of proper legal practice in order to fulfill the function of philosophical jurisprudence. In fact, much philosophical discussion of law assumes that such a characterization is the essential aim of jurisprudence. Second in order to arrive at a properly analyzed concept of law, both legal positivism and law as integrity are best constructed from specific techniques of analytic and linguistic philosophy. These techniques include the investigation and clarification of the way people commonly speak about law and careful parsing of social practice that separate the legal from the non-legal. The third common assumption is that the best way to understand legal practice is to understand the necessary and sufficient qualities that make some rule or statement into a law. Once such a set of necessary and sufficient conditions is identified (or approximated) it is thought that the essential aspects of particularly legal practices have been understood.

Instead of following this path, theorists within the law and economics movement have attacked the study of law from another angle. Rather than trying to identify unique conceptual aspects of law, what is advocated is an investigation of legal practices through the means of economic analysis. The conclusion offered is that legal practice is best understood through its function as a social tool promoting economic efficiency, in common with other social practices.

Instead of following this path, theorists within the law and economics movement have attacked the study of law from another angle. Rather than trying to identify unique conceptual aspects of law, what is advocated is an investigation of legal practices through the means of economic analysis. The conclusion offered is that legal practice is best described by its purported function as a social tool aiming at the promotion of economic efficiency - something it has in common with other social practices.

2. Law as a Tool to Encourage Economic Efficiency

So, instead of looking for the unique and defining features of law, the practitioner of law and economics looks at law as a social tool and tries to evaluate it functionally. What is emphasized is not its uniqueness as an institution, but its place within the general and common economic structure of society. The descriptive claim most often associated with law and economics is that legal practices are best characterized as tools for encouraging economically efficient social relations. To understand this claim it is important to examine some of the basic concepts used in models of economic reasoning.

a. Basic Concepts in Economic Reasoning

Essential to an understanding of the law and economics movement is a set of fundamental concepts. The most central assumption in economics is that human beings are rational maximizers of their individual satisfactions, and, in turn, respond to incentives. A rational maximizer of personal satisfaction adjusts means to ends in the most efficient way possible. It is important to realize that economics, as understood here, is not restricted to analysis of monetary issues; there are nonmonetary as well as monetary satisfactions. Every potential satisfaction is implicated in the calculus of economic satisfactions and therefore can be investigated according to economic or means-end rationality and the trade-off of costs and benefits. Normally what is aimed at through economic reasoning is the improvement of efficiency.

A more efficient allocation is one that increases the net value of resources. Efficiency in the allocation of resources is distinguished from equity, which is concerned with justice in the distribution of wealth. Because some people value specific goods higher or lower than others, economic efficiency can often be raised through voluntary transfers of goods. The most common example of a transfer promoting efficiency is that of a freely entered into contractual relationship. Because one party to the transaction values money more than the item owned, and the other values the item owned more than the asking price, the exchange produces a net gain in economic goods. Each person ends up better off than before. Some economists have gone so far as to argue that such a contractual exchange is morally optimal because it works within both Kantian and utilitarian theories of morality. They argue that it works with Kantian theories because a contract is thought to represent a good example of interaction between free and rational agents. It works with utilitarianism because the idea of wealth maximization intuitively translates into more utility.

Economists have a variety of terms to describe possible outcomes of economic exchanges. For instance Pareto optimality is defined as a point where resources are allocated such that no one is willing to trade further. Pareto optimality is the eventual endpoint of a series of Pareto superior moves. A Pareto superior change makes at least one person better of without making anyone worse off. Because no one is worse off after the trade there are no losers in Pareto improvements, although there may be many different Pareto optimal endpoints. Furthermore, economists have developed the concept of Kaldor-Hicks efficiency to compensate for obstacles to freely contracted exchanges. Kaldor-Hicks efficiency, or potential Pareto superiority, results when the overall economic gains outweigh the losses. In other words, the gains in economic efficiency are large enough that the winners could, if they had to, compensate the losers in the new allocation of goods and still remain better off.

b. How Law Can Encourage Economic Efficiency

The law and economics movement claims that law is best understood as a tool to promote economic efficiency. But how can the institution of law help encourage efficient transactions? One way is to help avoid situations that lead to market failure. One example of market failure is the existence of monopolies: a situation where one party is able to extract more profit from a good than a healthy market would allow. Law can be used as a tool to ensure that monopoly situations are hard to bring about and maintain. Another way legal systems can be used to ensure economically efficient transactions is through the enforcement of valid contracts. By ensuring compliance with contractual terms courts can give parties to a contract confidence that the other party will fulfill the agreed-to obligations. This becomes especially important in situations where the parties must complete their obligations at different times.

But some types of market failure are less obvious, and the legal means toward remedying them subtler. One problem in market transactions is that of externalities. An externality is a cost not reflected in the market price of a good. For instance, a factory may not have to internalize the costs it imposes upon the environment into the selling price of its goods. In this case the market price of the good will not reflect its real cost – and therefore some of the costs are imposed upon parties in an involuntary manner. Pigou argues in regard to this that legal means should be used to impose a marginal tax upon the offending party, to internalize any externalities. The economist Coase argued that this conclusion, while warranted in specific cases, was too global. Coase argued that in a market where transactions are costless and people do not act strategically, rights assignments are irrelevant because from any starting point the results will be economically efficient. In other words, the Coase Theorem states that if there are no transaction costs the assignment of entitlements will be irrelevant to the goal of allocative efficiency. In such a situation there will be no need for law to internalize costs because people will bargain to the most efficient possible allocation of goods. But outside of conceptually ideal markets there are always transaction costs such as information costs, opportunity costs and administrative costs. If transaction costs are somewhat high, then it does matter how property rights are assigned. Therefore the enforcement and allocation of legal entitlements will be an important factor in ensuring economically efficient exchanges. So law can be used to encourage economic efficiency. But is all law best described in economic terms?

c. Can All Law be Explained as Economic in Nature?

It may be no real surprise that law often is used to encourage efficient exchanges. But it seems a stretch to claim that law as an institution is best completely described in economic terms. It seems counterintuitive to view all law as based upon market principles. What the economic analysis of law manages, though , is to see such disparate areas as contract, tort and criminal law as all based upon economic aims, therefore giving law a more coherent basis than other theories can offer. Richard Posner argues that tort cases - those involving private harm - can be seen as contractual by looking for the hypothetical terms that the parties to an accident would have agreed to in advance in order to bring about the accident voluntarily. Also that criminals are deterred by the threat of punishment only if the likelihood of punishment multiplied by the quantity of punishment exceeds the gain offered by the  criminal act. Scholars have been quite effective in extending the tools of economic analysis into areas that seem to be anything but economic in nature. Even rules of evidence and legal ethics have proved amenable to economic analysis. However, it may be argued that an economic explanation of law fails on two counts. Firstly as a descriptive analysis it doesn’t do justice to everyday legal conceptions. Secondly  as an analytical analysis of the necessary conditions for the practice of law  it may not be able to account for the internal point of view which Hart thought so central to a proper understanding of law. More analytical approaches to economic explanation of law have considered this a fatal flaw in the project (see Coleman 2001). This may be mistakenly importing traditional philosophical aims into a drastically different project, but the truth is that it is often hard to tell what types of theoretical claims are being made within law and economics. If the claims are of exhaustive descriptive accuracy or of the necessary and sufficient conceptual foundations of law then it is more than likely a failure. But whether or not law and economics is an accurate or even conceptually necessary description of law as a social institution, and whether or not it suffices as a complete analysis of law, it could be argued that law should in any case adopt economic efficiency as the central aim guiding judicial decision-making.

3. Economics and Normative Jurisprudence

Though analytically incomplete, economic analysis models the actual results of legal institutions better than any other theory. This does not entail, however, that law ought to be consciously used for such an aim. Might not law be better used to consider issues related to  justice, duty and the like? Advocates of law and economics have argued against such a conclusion. The arguments usually are of two types. First, it is claimed that meanings of words such as justice or duty are so vague and in dispute that the use of such concepts for a basis of judicial decisions offers no guidance whatsoever. It is argued that while such concepts are unhelpfully complex, the tools of economic analysis and the concept of economic efficiency are sufficiently clear to provide the judge a solid and predictable basis of decision. Law is better able to decide according to efficiency rather than justice or duty due to limitations of institutional competence. This might be so if issues of justice are so complex as to involve information that courts are structurally unable to process. Second, it has been argued that because the paradigm case of justice is the freely entered in to contract, law is best seen as a tool to optimize contractual arrangements. If this is so, then where law can help is in situations where transaction costs are so high as to prohibit efficient contractual relationships. Here Posner argues that law can encourage economic efficiency by assigning property rights to those parties who would have secured them through market exchange if transaction costs were lower. In other words law should bring about allocations that mimic the results of a properly functioning market. In addition, advocates of economic analysis of law make a claim that other jurisprudential traditions seem to be unable to: that the analytic tools offered by law and economics has encouraged the further creation of other productive areas for analyzing law (see Posner 1998).

4. Later Developments

Another argument for the fertility of the economic analysis of law is that it has spawned a number of further tools that seem helpful in understanding legal institutions. Three of the most important of these are the results of behavioral economics, game theory and public choice theory.

a. Behavioral Economics and Law

Practitioners of behavioral law and economics examine human limits to means-end rationality. One of the outcomes of behavioral economics is the concept of bounded rationality. Bounded rationality means that information is not processed according to a model of perfect means-end rationality but, to the contrary, is distorted due to limits of our cognitive abilities. For instance the endowment effect is thought to be a behavioral limit that distorts the proper valuation of property, an important aspect of bargaining to efficient outcomes. According to the effect, the ownership of objects creates an irrational cognitive overvaluation of them. Another claim is that our cognitive abilities are distorted by the availability heuristic. According to this the availability of strong imagery may induce us to over or underestimate the actual probability of events associated with the image. For instance, graphic representations of highly improbable harms might be more influential on behavior and demand unjustified use of resources than statistical analysis showing another equally undesirable harm to be more common and easier to avoid. Jurisprudential practices could be significantly influenced by such results. For instance, judges might be as irrationally influenced by the availability heuristic as other human beings. Therefore victim impact statements might be important correctives to proceedings if a well-presented defendant’s presence in the court skews judge or jury's decisions. An awareness of such a cognitive failure could help adjust legal reasoning and its conclusions accordingly. Finally, an awareness and exploitation of universal cognitive limits might help legislators to design more effective laws (see Sunstein 2000).

b. Game Theory

Game theory adds to economic modeling the phenomenon of strategic action. Strategic actions are those adopted because of the competitive nature of many social transactions. They are adopted due to how one individual expects another to act in response. For example, a person who wishes to buy an item cheap would act disinterested so as not to signal his or her actual desires to the seller. Addition of analytic tools dealing with strategic action greatly strengthens the economic analysis of law. For instance, the Coase theorem, to function properly, necessarily excludes strategic action; cooperation is just assumed. But it seems apparent that legal actions often are deeply implicated in and animated by strategic motives. Common sense tells us that full open cooperation is not always the best path to bringing about one’s desired results. In fact much of the bargaining invested in designing an effective contract seems to be done in the shadow of potential strategic action on the part of the contracting parties. Designing legal rules with an eye to the possibility of strategic action helps ensure that the rules will not create perverse outcomes. For instance, if a defendant’s privilege against self-incrimination could also encourage an inference of guilt from the silence the privilege would be all but useless. Therefore, courts have not only barred comment on the refusal to testify but also have required that juries, on defendant’s request, make no inference from such a choice (see Baird et al 1994). Further, the understanding that legislators might have adopted specific wording for a law based upon strategic motives may help direct the proper aims of judicial interpretation. This type of claim, though, is often better analyzed by the tools offered in public choice theory.

c. Public Choice Theory

Public choice theory is centered upon how the nature of the legislative process and collective decision making influence the nature of law. It is the application of economic models of decision-making and their results to the issues that traditionally occupy political science, for example Arrow's Theorem. One claim made within public choice theory is that a proper understanding of collective decision processes will help judges understand their position within the system. If all collective decisions are unavoidably influenced by those who get to frame the questions debated and the order of voting - the agenda-setters - public legislation will need to be interpreted differently than if it were a more neutral recording of collective wishes. Such a theoretical result makes problematic a court’s reference to the intent of the legislature.

5. References and Further Readings

  • Ackerman, Bruce, The Economic Foundations of Property Law (Boston: Little, Brown & Co., 1975)
  • Baird, Douglas, Robert Gertner and Randal Picker, Game Theory and the Law (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1994)
  • Becker, Gary S., "Nobel Lecture: The Economic Way of Looking at Behavior," 101 Journal of Political Economy 385 (1993)
  • Calabresi, Guido, The Costs of Accidents (1970)
  • Calabresi, Guido, and Douglas Melamed, "Property Rules, Liability Rules and Inalienability: One View of the Cathedral," 85 Harvard Law Review 1089 (1972)
  • Calabresi, Guido, "Some Thoughts on Risk Distribution and the Law of Torts," 70 Yale Law Journal 499 (1961)
  • Coase, Ronald, "The Problem of Social Cost," 3 Journal of Law and Economics 1 (1960)
  • Coleman, Jules, "Efficiency, Auction and Exchange: Philosophic Aspects of the Economic Approach to Law," 68 California Law Review 221 (1980)
  • Coleman, Jules, Market, Morals and the Law (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988)
  • Coleman, Jules, The Practice of Principle: In Defense of a Pragmatist Approach to Legal Theory (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2001)
  • Cotter, Thomas F., "Legal Pragmatism and the Law and Economics Movement," 84 Georgetown Law Journal 2071 (1996)
  • Farber, Daniel, and Philip Frickey, Law and Public Choice (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1991)
  • Harrison, Jeffrey L., Law and Economics (St. Paul: West Group, 1995)
  • Horwitz, Morton, "Law and Economics: Science or Politics?," 8 Hofstra Law Review 905 (1981)
  • Katz, Avery Weiner, Foundations of the Economic Approach to Law (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998)
  • Landes, William and Richard Posner, The Economic Structure of Tort Law (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1987)
  • Leff, Arthur, "Economic Analysis of Law: Some Realism About Nominalism," 60 Virginia Law Review 451 (1974)
  • Miceli, Thomas J., Economics of the Law: Torts, Contracts, Property, Litigation (1997)
  • Murphy, Jeffrie G. and Jules L. Coleman, Philosophy of Law (Boulder: Westview Press, 1990)
  • Polinsky, A. Mitchell, An Introduction to Law and Economics (Boston: Little, Brown & Company, 1989)
  • Posner, Richard A., Economic Analysis of Law (New York: Aspen, 5th ed., 1998)
  • Posner, Richard A., The Economics of Justice (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1983)
  • Posner, Richard A., Frontiers of Legal Theory (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2001)
  • Posner, Richard A., "Gary Becker's Contributions to Law and Economics," 22 Journal of Legal Studies 211 (1993)
  • "Symposium on Post-Chicago Law and Economics," 65 Chicago-Kent Law Review 1 (1989)
  • Sunstein, Cass R., Behavioral Law and Economics (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000)

Author Information

Brian Edgar Butler
University of North Carolina at Asheville
U. S. A.

Philosophy of Law

law_scalesPhilosophy of law (or legal philosophy) is concerned with providing a general philosophical analysis of law and legal institutions. Issues in the field range from abstract conceptual questions about the nature of law and legal systems to normative questions about the relationship between law and morality and the justification for various legal institutions.

Topics in legal philosophy tend to be more abstract than related topics in political philosophy and applied ethics. For example, whereas the question of how properly to interpret the U.S. Constitution belongs to democratic theory (and hence falls under the heading of political philosophy), the analysis of legal interpretation falls under the heading of legal philosophy. Likewise, whereas the question of whether capital punishment is morally permissible falls under the heading of applied ethics, the question of whether the institution of punishment can be justified falls under the heading of legal philosophy.

There are roughly three categories into which the topics of legal philosophy fall: analytic jurisprudence, normative jurisprudence, and critical theories of law. Analytic jurisprudence involves providing an analysis of the essence of law so as to understand what differentiates it from other systems of norms, such as ethics. Normative jurisprudence involves the examination of normative, evaluative, and otherwise prescriptive issues about the law, such as restrictions on freedom, obligations to obey the law, and the grounds for punishment. Finally, critical theories of law, such as critical legal studies and feminist jurisprudence, challenge more traditional forms of legal philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Analytic Jurisprudence
    1. Natural Law Theory
    2. Legal Positivism
      1. The Conventionality Thesis
      2. The Social Fact Thesis
      3. The Separability Thesis
    3. Ronald Dworkin's Third Theory
  2. Normative Jurisprudence
    1. Freedom and the Limits of Legitimate Law
      1. Legal Moralism
      2. Legal Paternalism
      3. The Offense Principle
    2. The Obligation to Obey Law
    3. The Justification of Punishment
  3. Critical Theories of Law
    1. Legal Realism
    2. Critical Legal Studies
    3. Law and Economics
    4. Outsider Jurisprudence
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Analytic Jurisprudence

The principal objective of analytic jurisprudence has traditionally been to provide an account of what distinguishes law as a system of norms from other systems of norms, such as ethical norms. As John Austin describes the project, analytic jurisprudence seeks "the essence or nature which is common to all laws that are properly so called" (Austin 1995, p. 11). Accordingly, analytic jurisprudence is concerned with providing necessary and sufficient conditions for the existence of law that distinguish law from non-law.

While this task is usually interpreted as an attempt to analyze the concepts of law and legal system, there is some confusion as to both the value and character of conceptual analysis in philosophy of law. As Brian Leiter (1998) points out, philosophy of law is one of the few philosophical disciplines that takes conceptual analysis as its principal concern; most other areas in philosophy have taken a naturalistic turn, incorporating the tools and methods of the sciences. To clarify the role of conceptual analysis in law, Brian Bix (1995) distinguishes a number of different purposes that can be served by conceptual claims:

  1. to track linguistic usage;
  2. to stipulate meanings;
  3. to explain what is important or essential about a class of objects; and
  4. to establish an evaluative test for the concept-word.

Bix takes conceptual analysis in law to be primarily concerned with (3) and (4).

In any event, conceptual analysis of law remains an important, if controversial, project in contemporary legal theory. Conceptual theories of law can be divided into two main headings: (a) those that affirm there is a conceptual relation between law and morality and (b) those that deny that there is such a relation. Nevertheless, Ronald Dworkin's view is often characterized as a third theory partly because it is not clear where he stands on the question of whether there is a conceptual relation between law and morality.

a. Natural Law Theory

All forms of natural law theory subscribe to the Overlap Thesis, which is that there is a necessary relation between the concepts of law and morality. According to this view, then, the concept of law cannot be fully articulated without some reference to moral notions. Though the Overlap Thesis may seem unambiguous, there are a number of different ways in which it can be interpreted.

The strongest form of the Overlap Thesis underlies the classical naturalism of St. Thomas Aquinas and William Blackstone. As Blackstone describes the thesis:

This law of nature, being co-eval with mankind and dictated by God himself, is of course superior in obligation to any other. It is binding over all the globe, in all countries, and at all times: no human laws are of any validity, if contrary to this; and such of them as are valid derive all their force, and all their authority, mediately or immediately, from this original (1979, p. 41).

In this passage, Blackstone articulates the two claims that constitute the theoretical core of classical naturalism: 1) there can be no legally valid standards that conflict with the natural law; and 2) all valid laws derive what force and authority they have from the natural law. On this view, to paraphrase Augustine, an unjust law is no law at all.

Related to Blackstone's classical naturalism is the neo-naturalism of John Finnis (1980). Finnis believes that the naturalism of Aquinas and Blackstone should not be construed as a conceptual account of the existence conditions for law. According to Finnis (see also Bix, 1996), the classical naturalists were not concerned with giving a conceptual account of legal validity; rather they were concerned with explaining the moral force of law: "the principles of natural law explain the obligatory force (in the fullest sense of "obligation") of positive laws, even when those laws cannot be deduced from those principles" (Finnis 1980, pp. 23-24). On Finnis's view of the Overlap Thesis, the essential function of law is to provide a justification for state coercion. Accordingly, an unjust law can be legally valid, but cannot provide an adequate justification for use of the state coercive power and is hence not obligatory in the fullest sense; thus, an unjust law fails to realize the moral ideals implicit in the concept of law. An unjust law, on this view, is legally binding, but is not fully law.

Lon Fuller (1964) rejects the idea that there are necessary moral constraints on the content of law. On Fuller's view, law is necessarily subject to a procedural morality consisting of eight principles:

P1: the rules must be expressed in general terms;
P2: the rules must be publicly promulgated;
P3: the rules must be prospective in effect;
P4: the rules must be expressed in understandable terms;
P5: the rules must be consistent with one another;
P6: the rules must not require conduct beyond the powers of the affected parties;
P7: the rules must not be changed so frequently that the subject cannot rely on them; and
P8: the rules must be administered in a manner consistent with their wording.

On Fuller's view, no system of rules that fails minimally to satisfy these principles of legality can achieve law's essential purpose of achieving social order through the use of rules that guide behavior. A system of rules that fails to satisfy (P2) or (P4), for example, cannot guide behavior because people will not be able to determine what the rules require. Accordingly, Fuller concludes that his eight principles are "internal" to law in the sense that they are built into the existence conditions for law: "A total failure in any one of these eight directions does not simply result in a bad system of law; it results in something that is not properly called a legal system at all" (1964, p. 39).

b. Legal Positivism

Opposed to all forms of naturalism is legal positivism, which is roughly constituted by three theoretical commitments: (i) the Social Fact Thesis, (ii) the Conventionality Thesis, and (iii) the Separability Thesis. The Social Fact Thesis (which is also known as the Pedigree Thesis) asserts that it is a necessary truth that legal validity is ultimately a function of certain kinds of social facts. The Conventionality Thesis emphasizes law's conventional nature, claiming that the social facts giving rise to legal validity are authoritative in virtue of some kind of social convention. The Separability Thesis, at the most general level, simply denies naturalism's Overlap Thesis; according to the Separability Thesis, there is no conceptual overlap between the notions of law and morality.

i. The Conventionality Thesis

According to the Conventionality Thesis, it is a conceptual truth about law that legal validity can ultimately be explained in terms of criteria that are authoritative in virtue of some kind of social convention. Thus, for example, H.L.A. Hart (1996) believes the criteria of legal validity are contained in a rule of recognition that sets forth rules for creating, changing, and adjudicating law. On Hart's view, the rule of recognition is authoritative in virtue of a convention among officials to regard its criteria as standards that govern their behavior as officials. While Joseph Raz does not appear to endorse Hart's view about a master rule of recognition containing the criteria of validity, he also believes the validity criteria are authoritative only in virtue of a convention among officials.

ii. The Social Fact Thesis

The Social Fact Thesis asserts that legal validity is a function of certain social facts. Borrowing heavily from Jeremy Bentham, John Austin (1995) argues that the principal distinguishing feature of a legal system is the presence of a sovereign who is habitually obeyed by most people in the society, but not in the habit of obeying any determinate human superior. On Austin's view, a rule R is legally valid (that is, is a law) in a society S if and only if R is commanded by the sovereign in S and is backed up with the threat of a sanction. The relevant social fact that confers validity, on Austin's view, is promulgation by a sovereign willing to impose a sanction for noncompliance.

Hart takes a different view of the Social Fact Thesis. Hart believes that Austin's theory accounts, at most, for one kind of rule: primary rules that require or prohibit certain kinds of behavior. On Hart's view, Austin overlooked the presence of other primary rules that confer upon citizens the power to create, modify, and extinguish rights and obligations in other persons. As Hart points out, the rules governing the creation of contracts and wills cannot plausibly be characterized as restrictions on freedom that are backed by the threat of a sanction.

Most importantly, however, Hart argues Austin overlooks the existence of secondary meta-rules that have as their subject matter the primary rules themselves and distinguish full-blown legal systems from primitive systems of law:

[Secondary rules] may all be said to be on a different level from the primary rules, for they are all about such rules; in the sense that while primary rules are concerned with the actions that individuals must or must not do, these secondary rules are all concerned with the primary rules themselves. They specify the way in which the primary rules may be conclusively ascertained, introduced, eliminated, varied, and the fact of their violation conclusively determined (Hart 1994, p. 92).

Hart distinguishes three types of secondary rules that mark the transition from primitive forms of law to full-blown legal systems: (1) the rule of recognition, which "specif[ies] some feature or features possession of which by a suggested rule is taken as a conclusive affirmative indication that it is a rule of the group to be supported by the social pressure it exerts" (Hart 1994, p. 92); (2) the rule of change, which enables a society to add, remove, and modify valid rules; and (3) the rule of adjudication, which provides a mechanism for determining whether a valid rule has been violated. On Hart's view, then, every society with a full-blown legal system necessarily has a rule of recognition that articulates criteria for legal validity that include provisions for making, changing and adjudicating law. Law is, to use Hart's famous phrase, "the union of primary and secondary rules" (Hart 1994, p. 107).

According to Hart's view of the Social Fact Thesis, then, a proposition P is legally valid in a society S if and only if it satisfies the criteria of validity contained in a rule of recognition that is binding in S. As we have seen, the Conventionality Thesis implies that a rule of recognition is binding in S only if there is a social convention among officials to treat it as defining standards of official behavior. Thus, on Hart's view, "[the] rules of recognition specifying the criteria of legal validity and its rules of change and adjudication must be effectively accepted as common public standards of official behaviour by its officials" (Hart 1994, p. 113).

iii. The Separability Thesis

The final thesis comprising the foundation of legal positivism is the Separability Thesis. In its most general form, the Separability Thesis asserts that law and morality are conceptually distinct. This abstract formulation can be interpreted in a number of ways. For example, Klaus F¸þer (1996) interprets it as making a meta-level claim that the definition of law must be entirely free of moral notions. This interpretation implies that any reference to moral considerations in defining the related notions of law, legal validity, and legal system is inconsistent with the Separability Thesis.

More commonly, the Separability Thesis is interpreted as making only an object-level claim about the existence conditions for legal validity. As Hart describes it, the Separability Thesis is no more than the "simple contention that it is in no sense a necessary truth that laws reproduce or satisfy certain demands of morality, though in fact they have often done so" (Hart 1994, pp. 181-82). Insofar as the object-level interpretation of the Separability Thesis denies it is a necessary truth that there are moral constraints on legal validity, it implies the existence of a possible legal system in which there are no moral constraints on legal validity.

Though all positivists agree there are possible legal systems without moral constraints on legal validity, there are conflicting views on whether there are possible legal systems with such constraints. According to inclusive positivism (also known as incorporationism and soft positivism), it is possible for a society's rule of recognition to incorporate moral constraints on the content of law. Prominent inclusive positivists include Jules Coleman and Hart, who maintains that "the rule of recognition may incorporate as criteria of legal validity conformity with moral principles or substantive values ... such as the Sixteenth or Nineteenth Amendments to the United States Constitution respecting the establishment of religion or abridgements of the right to vote" (Hart 1994, p. 250).

In contrast, exclusive positivism (also called hard positivism) denies that a legal system can incorporate moral constraints on legal validity. Exclusive positivists like Raz (1979) subscribe to the Source Thesis, according to which the existence and content of law can always be determined by reference to its sources without recourse to moral argument. On this view, the sources of law include both the circumstances of its promulgation and relevant interpretative materials, such as court cases involving its application.

c. Ronald Dworkin's Third Theory

Ronald Dworkin rejects positivism's Social Fact Thesis on the ground that there are some legal standards the authority of which cannot be explained in terms of social facts. In deciding hard cases, for example, judges often invoke moral principles that Dworkin believes do not derive their legal authority from the social criteria of legality contained in a rule of recognition (Dworkin 1977, p. 40). Nevertheless, since judges are bound to consider such principles when relevant, they must be characterized as law. Thus, Dworkin concludes, "if we treat principles as law we must reject the positivists' first tenet, that the law of a community is distinguished from other social standards by some test in the form of a master rule" (Dworkin 1977, p. 44).

Dworkin believes adjudication is and should be interpretive: "judges should decide hard cases by interpreting the political structure of their community in the following, perhaps special way: by trying to find the best justification they can find, in principles of political morality, for the structure as a whole, from the most profound constitutional rules and arrangements to the details of, for example, the private law of tort or contract" (Dworkin 1982, p. 165). There are, then, two elements of a successful interpretation. First, since an interpretation is successful insofar as it justifies the particular practices of a particular society, the interpretation must fit with those practices in the sense that it coheres with existing legal materials defining the practices. Second, since an interpretation provides a moral justification for those practices, it must present them in the best possible moral light. Thus, Dworkin argues, a judge should strive to interpret a case in roughly the following way:

A thoughtful judge might establish for himself, for example, a rough "threshold" of fit which any interpretation of data must meet in order to be "acceptable" on the dimension of fit, and then suppose that if more than one interpretation of some part of the law meets this threshold, the choice among these should be made, not through further and more precise comparisons between the two along that dimension, but by choosing the interpretation which is "substantively" better, that is, which better promotes the political ideals he thinks correct (Dworkin 1982, p. 171).

Accordingly, on Dworkin's view, the legal authority of a binding principle derives from the contribution it makes to the best moral justification for a society's legal practices considered as a whole. Thus, a legal principle maximally contributes to such a justification if and only if it satisfies two conditions:

  1. the principle coheres with existing legal materials; and
  2. the principle is the most morally attractive standard that satisfies (1).

The correct legal principle is the one that makes the law the moral best it can be.

In later writings, Dworkin expands the scope of his "constructivist" view beyond adjudication to encompass the realm of legal theory. Dworkin distinguishes conversational interpretation from artistic/creative interpretation and argues that the task of interpreting a social practice is more like artistic interpretation:

The most familiar occasion of interpretation is conversation. We interpret the sounds or marks another person makes in order to decide what he has said. Artistic interpretation is yet another: critics interpret poems and plays and paintings in order to defend some view of their meaning or theme or point. The form of interpretation we are studying-the interpretation of a social practice-is like artistic interpretation in this way: both aim to interpret something created by people as an entity distinct from them, rather than what people say, as in conversational interpretation" (Dworkin 1986, p. 50).

Artistic interpretation, like judicial interpretation, is constrained by the dimensions of fit and justification: "constructive interpretation is a matter of imposing purpose on an object or practice in order to make of it the best possible example of the form or genre to which it is taken to belong" (Dworkin 1986, p. 52).

On Dworkin's view, the point of any general theory of law is to interpret a very complex set of related social practices that are "created by people as an entity distinct from them"; for this reason, Dworkin believes the project of putting together a general theory of law is inherently constructivist:

General theories of law must be abstract because they aim to interpret the main point and structure of legal practice, not some particular part or department of it. But for all their abstraction, they are constructive interpretations: they try to show legal practice as a whole in its best light, to achieve equilibrium between legal practice as they find it and the best justification of that practice. So no firm line divides jurisprudence from adjudication or any other aspect of legal practice (Dworkin 1986, p. 90).

Indeed, so tight is the relation between jurisprudence and adjudication, according to Dworkin, that jurisprudence is no more than the most general part of adjudication; thus, Dworkin concludes, "any judge's opinion is itself a piece of legal philosophy" (Dworkin 1986, p. 90).

Accordingly, Dworkin rejects not only positivism's Social Fact Thesis, but also what he takes to be its underlying presuppositions about legal theory. Hart distinguishes two perspectives from which a set of legal practices can be understood. A legal practice can be understood from the "internal" point of view of the person who accepts that practice as providing legitimate guides to conduct, as well as from the "external" point of view of the observer who wishes to understand the practice but does not accept it as being authoritative or legitimate.

Hart understands his theory of law to be both descriptive and general in the sense that it provides an account of fundamental features common to all legal systems-which presupposes a point of view that is external to all legal systems. For this reason, he regards his project as "a radically different enterprise from Dworkin's conception of legal theory (or 'jurisprudence' as he often terms it) as in part evaluative and justificatory and as 'addressed to a particular legal culture', which is usually the theorist's own and in Dworkin's case is that of Anglo-American law" (Hart 1994, p. 240).

These remarks show Hart believes Dworkin's theoretical objectives are fundamentally different from those of positivism, which, as a theory of analytic jurisprudence, is largely concerned with conceptual analysis. For his part, Dworkin conceives his work as conceptual but not in the same sense that Hart regards his work:

We all-at least all lawyers-share a concept of law and of legal right, and we contest different conceptions of that concept. Positivism defends a particular conception, and I have tried to defend a competing conception. We disagree about what legal rights are in much the same way as we philosophers who argue about justice disagree about what justice is. I concentrate on the details of a particular legal system with which I am especially familiar, not simply to show that positivism provides a poor account of that system, but to show that positivism provides a poor conception of the concept of a legal right (Dworkin 1977, 351-52).

These differences between Hart and Dworkin have led many legal philosophers, most recently Bix (1996), to suspect that they are not really taking inconsistent positions at all. Accordingly, there remains an issue as to whether Dworkin's work should be construed as falling under the rubric of analytic jurisprudence.

2. Normative Jurisprudence

Normative jurisprudence involves normative, evaluative, and otherwise prescriptive questions about the law. Here we will examine three key issues: (a) when and to what extent laws can restrict the freedom of citizens, (b) the nature of one's obligation to obey the law, and (c) the justification of punishment by law.

a. Freedom and the Limits of Legitimate Law

Laws limit human autonomy by restricting freedom. Criminal laws, for example, remove certain behaviors from the range of behavioral options by penalizing them with imprisonment and, in some cases, death. Likewise, civil laws require people to take certain precautions not to injure others and to honor their contracts. Given that human autonomy deserves prima facie moral respect, the question arises as to what are the limits of the state's legitimate authority to restrict the freedom of its citizens.

John Stuart Mill provides the classic liberal answer in the form of the harm principle:

[T]he sole end for which mankind are warranted, individually or collectively, in interfering with the liberty of action of any of their number is self-protection. The only purpose for which power can rightfully be exercised over any member of a civilised community against his will is to prevent harm to others. His own good, either physical or moral, is not a sufficient warrant. Over himself, over his own body and mind, the individual is sovereign (Mill 1906, pp. 12-13).

While Mill left the notion of harm underdeveloped, he is most frequently taken to mean only physical harms and more extreme forms of psychological harm.

Though Mill's view—or something like it—enjoys currency among the public, it has generated considerable controversy among philosophers of law and political philosophers. Many philosophers believe that Mill understates the limits of legitimate state authority over the individual, claiming that law may be used to enforce morality, to protect the individual from herself, and in some cases to protect individuals from offensive behavior.

i. Legal Moralism

Legal moralism is the view that the law can legitimately be used to prohibit behaviors that conflict with society's collective moral judgments even when those behaviors do not result in physical or psychological harm to others. According to this view, a person's freedom can legitimately be restricted simply because it conflicts with society's collective morality; thus, legal moralism implies that it is permissible for the state to use its coercive power to enforce society's collective morality.

The most famous legal moralist is Patrick Devlin, who argues that a shared morality is essential to the existence of a society:

[I]f men and women try to create a society in which there is no fundamental agreement about good and evil they will fail; if, having based it on common agreement, the agreement goes, the society will disintegrate. For society is not something that is kept together physically; it is held by the invisible bonds of common thought. If the bonds were too far relaxed the members would drift apart. A common morality is part of the bondage. The bondage is part of the price of society; and mankind, which needs society, must pay its price. (Devlin 1965, p. 10).

Insofar as human beings cannot lead a meaningful existence outside of society, it follows, on Devlin's view, that the law can be used to preserve the shared morality as a means of preserving society itself.

H.L.A. Hart (1963) points out that Devlin overstates the extent to which preservation of a shared morality is necessary to the continuing existence of a society. Devlin attempts to conclude from the necessity of a shared social morality that it is permissible for the state to legislate sexual morality (in particular, to legislate against same-sex sexual relations), but Hart argues it is implausible to think that "deviation from accepted sexual morality, even by adults in private, is something which, like treason, threatens the existence of society" (Hart 1963, p. 50). While enforcement of certain social norms protecting life, safety, and property are likely essential to the existence of a society, a society can survive a diversity of behavior in many other areas of moral concern-as is evidenced by the controversies in the U.S. surrounding abortion and homosexuality.

ii. Legal Paternalism

Legal paternalism is the view that it is permissible for the state to legislate against what Mill calls "self-regarding actions" when necessary to prevent individuals from inflicting physical or severe emotional harm on themselves. As Gerald Dworkin describes it, a paternalist interference is an "interference with a person's liberty of action justified by reasons referring exclusively to the welfare, good, happiness, needs, interests or values of the person being coerced" (G. Dworkin 1972, p. 65). Thus, for example, a law requiring use of a helmet when riding a motorcycle is a paternalistic interference insofar as it is justified by concerns for the safety of the rider.

Dworkin argues that Mill's view that a person "cannot rightfully be compelled to do or forbear because it will be better for him" (Mill 1906, p. 13) precludes paternalistic legislation to which fully rational individuals would agree. According to Dworkin, there are goods, such as health and education, that any rational person needs to pursue her own good-no matter how that good is conceived. Thus, Dworkin concludes, the attainment of these basic goods can legitimately be promoted in certain circumstances by using the state's coercive force.

Dworkin offers a hypothetical consent justification for his limited legal paternalism. On his view, there are a number of different situations in which fully rational adults would consent to paternalistic restrictions on freedom. For example, Dworkin believes a fully rational adult would consent to paternalistic restrictions to protect her from making decisions that are "far-reaching, potentially dangerous and irreversible" (G. Dworkin 1972, p. 80). Nevertheless, he argues that there are limits to legitimate paternalism: (1) the state must show that the behavior governed by the proposed restriction involves the sort of harm that a rational person would want to avoid; (2) on the calculations of a fully rational person, the potential harm outweighs the benefits of the relevant behavior; and (3) the proposed restriction is the least restrictive alternative for protecting against the harm.

iii. The Offense Principle

Joel Feinberg believes the harm principle does not provide sufficient protection against the wrongful behaviors of others, as it is inconsistent with many criminal prohibitions we take for granted as being justified. If the only legitimate use of the state coercive force is to protect people from harm caused by others, then statutes prohibiting public sex are impermissible because public sex might be offensive but it does not cause harm (in the Millian sense) to others.

Accordingly, Feinberg argues the harm principle must be augmented by the offense principle, which he defines as follows: "It is always a good reason in support of a proposed criminal prohibition that it would probably be an effective way of preventing serious offense (as opposed to injury or harm) to persons other than the actor, and that it is probably a necessary means to that end" (Feinberg 1985). By "offense," Feinberg intends a subjective and objective element: the subjective element consists in the experience of an unpleasant mental state (for example, shame, disgust, anxiety, embarrassment); the objective element consists in the existence of a wrongful cause of such a mental state.

b. The Obligation to Obey Law

Natural law critics of positivism (for example, Fuller 1958) frequently complain that if positivism is correct, there cannot be a moral obligation to obey the law qua law (that is, to obey the law as such, no matter what the laws are, simply because it is the law). As Feinberg (1979) puts the point:

The positivist account of legal validity is hard to reconcile with the [claim] that valid law as such, no matter what its content, deserves our respect and general fidelity. Even if valid law is bad law, we have some obligation to obey it simply because it is law. But how can this be so if a law's validity has nothing to do with its content?

The idea is this: if what is essential to law is just that there exist specified recipes for making law, then there cannot be a moral obligation to obey a rule simply because it is the law.

Contemporary positivists, for the most part, accept the idea that positivism is inconsistent with an obligation to obey law qua law (compare Himma 1998), but argue that the mere status of a norm as law cannot give rise to any moral obligation to obey that norm. While there might be a moral obligation to obey a particular law because of its moral content (for example, laws prohibiting murder) or because it solves a coordination problem (for example, laws requiring people to drive on the right side of the road), the mere fact that a rule is law does not provide a moral reason for doing what the law requires.

Indeed, arguments for the existence of even a prima facie obligation to obey law (that is, an obligation that can be outweighed by competing obligations) have largely been unsuccessful. Arguments in favor of an obligation to obey the law roughly fall into four categories: (1) arguments from gratitude; (2) arguments from fair play; (3) arguments from implied consent; and (4) arguments from general utility.

The argument from gratitude begins with the observation that all persons, even those who are worst off, derive some benefit from the state's enforcement of the law. On this view, a person who accepts benefits from another person thereby incurs a duty of gratitude towards the benefactor. And the only plausible way to discharge this duty towards the government is to obey its laws. Nevertheless, as M.B.E. Smith points out (1973, p. 953), "if someone confers benefits on me without any consideration of whether I want them, and if he does this in order to advance some purpose other than promotion of my particular welfare, I have no obligation to be grateful towards him." Since the state does not give citizens a choice with respect to such benefits, the mere enjoyment of them cannot give rise to a duty of gratitude.

John Rawls (1964) argues that there is a moral obligation to obey law qua law in societies in which there is a mutually beneficial and just scheme of social cooperation. What gives rise to a moral obligation to obey law qua law in such societies is a duty of fair play: fairness requires obedience of persons who intentionally accept the benefits made available in a society organized around a just scheme of mutually beneficial cooperation. There are a couple of problems here. First, Rawls's argument does not establish the existence of a content-independent obligation to obey law; the obligation arises only in those societies that institutionalize a just scheme of social cooperation. Second, even in such societies, citizens are not presented with a genuine option to refuse those benefits. For example, I cannot avoid the benefits of laws ensuring clean air. But accepting benefits one is not in a position to refuse cannot give rise to an obligation of fair play.

The argument from consent grounds an obligation to obey law on some sort of implied promise. As is readily evident, we can voluntarily assume obligations by consenting to them or making a promise. Of course, most citizens never explicitly promise or consent to obey the laws; for this reason, proponents of this argument attempt to infer consent from such considerations as continued residence and acceptance of benefits from the state. Nevertheless, acceptance of benefits one cannot decline no more implies consent to obey law than it does duties of fair play or gratitude. Moreover, the prohibitive difficulties associated with emigration preclude an inference of consent from continued residence.

Finally, the argument from general utility grounds the duty to obey the law in the consequences of universal disobedience. Since, according to this argument, the consequences of general disobedience would be catastrophic, it is wrong for any individual to disobey the law; for no person may disobey the law unless everyone may do so. In response, Smith points out that this strategy of argument leads to absurdities: "We will have to maintain, for example, that there is a prima facie obligation not to eat dinner at five o'clock, for if everyone did so, certain essential services could not be maintained" (Smith 1973, p. 966).

c. The Justification of Punishment

Punishment is unique among putatively legitimate acts in that its point is to inflict discomfort on the recipient; an act that is incapable of causing a person minimal discomfort cannot be characterized as a punishment. In most contexts, the commission of an act for the purpose of inflicting discomfort is morally problematic because of its resemblance to torture. For this reason, institutional punishment requires a moral justification sufficient to distinguish it from other practices of purposely inflicting discomfort on other people.

Justifications for punishment typically take five forms: (1) retributive; (2) deterrence; (3) preventive; (4) rehabilitative; and (5) restitutionary. According to the retributive justification, what justifies punishing a person is that she committed an offense that deserves the punishment. On this view, it is morally appropriate that a person who has committed a wrongful act should suffer in proportion to the magnitude of her wrongdoing. The problem, however, is that the mere fact that someone is deserving of punishment does not imply it is morally permissible for the state to administer punishment; it would be wrong for me, for example, to punish someone else's child even though her behavior might deserve it.

In contrast to the retributivist theories that look back to a person's prior wrongful act as justification for punishment, utilitarian theories look forward to the beneficial consequences of punishing a person. There are three main lines of utilitarian reasoning. According to the deterrence justification, punishment of a wrongdoer is justified by the socially beneficial effects that it has on other persons. On this view, punishment deters wrongdoing by persons who would otherwise commit wrongful acts. The problem with the deterrence theory is that it justifies punishment of one person on the strength of the effects that it has on other persons. The idea that it is permissible to deliberately inflict discomfort on one person because doing so may have beneficial effects on the behavior of other persons appears inconsistent with the Kantian principle that it is wrong to use people as mere means.

The preventive justification argues that incarcerating a person for wrongful acts is justified insofar as it prevents that person from committing wrongful acts against society during the period of incarceration. The rehabilitative justification argues that punishment is justified in virtue of the effect that it has on the moral character of the offender. Each of these justifications suffers from the same flaw: prevention of crime and rehabilitation of the offender can be achieved without the deliberate infliction of discomfort that constitutes punishment. For example, prevention of crime might require detaining the offender, but it does not require detention in an environment that is as unpleasant as those typically found in prisons.

The restitutionary justification focuses on the effect of the offender's wrongful act on the victim. Other theories of punishment conceptualize the wrongful act as an offense against society; the restitutionary theory sees wrongdoing as an offense against the victim. Thus, on this view, the principal purpose of punishment must be to make the victim whole to the extent that this can be done: "The point is not that the offender deserves to suffer; it is rather that the offended party desires compensation" (Barnett 1977, p. 289). Accordingly, a criminal convicted of wrongdoing should be sentenced to compensate her victim in proportion to the victim's loss. The problem with the restitutionary theory is that it fails to distinguish between compensation and punishment. Compensatory objectives focus on the victim, while punitive objectives focus on the offender.

3. Critical Theories of Law

a. Legal Realism

The legal realist movement was inspired by John Chipman Gray and Oliver Wendall Holmes and reached its apex in the 1920s and 30s through the work of Karl Llewellyn, Jerome Frank, and Felix Cohen. The realists eschewed the conceptual approach of the positivists and naturalists in favor of an empirical analysis that sought to show how practicing judges really decide cases (see Leiter 1998). The realists were deeply skeptical of the ascendant notion that judicial legislation is a rarity. While not entirely rejecting the idea that judges can be constrained by rules, the realists maintained that judges create new law through the exercise of lawmaking discretion considerably more often than is commonly supposed. On their view, judicial decision is guided far more frequently by political and moral intuitions about the facts of the case (instead of by legal rules) than theories like positivism and naturalism acknowledge.

As an historical matter, legal realism arose in response to legal formalism, a particular model of legal reasoning that assimilates legal reasoning to syllogistic reasoning. According to the formalist model, the legal outcome (that is, the holding) logically follows from the legal rule (major premise) and a statement of the relevant facts (minor premise). Realists believe that formalism understates judicial lawmaking abilities insofar as it represents legal outcomes as entailed syllogistically by applicable rules and facts. For if legal outcomes are logically implied by propositions that bind judges, it follows that judges lack legal authority to reach conflicting outcomes.

Legal realism can roughly be characterized by the following claims:

  1. the class of available legal materials is insufficient to logically entail a unique legal outcome in most cases worth litigating at the appellate level (the Local Indeterminacy Thesis);
  2. in such cases, judges make new law in deciding legal disputes through the exercise of a lawmaking discretion (the Discretion Thesis); and
  3. judicial decisions in indeterminate cases are influenced by the judge's political and moral convictions, not by legal considerations.

Though (3) is logically independent of (1) and (2), (1) seems to imply (2): insofar as judges decide legally indeterminate cases, they must be creating new law.

It is worth noting the relations between legal realism, formalism, and positivism. While formalism is often thought to be entailed by positivism, it turns out that legal realism is not only consistent with positivism, but also presupposes the truth of all three of positivism's core theses. Indeed, the realist acknowledges that law is essentially the product of official activity, but believes that judicial lawmaking occurs more frequently than is commonly assumed. But the idea that law is essentially the product of official activity presupposes the truth of positivism's Conventionality, Social Fact, and Separability theses. Though the preoccupations of the realists were empirical (that is, attempting to identify the psychological and sociological factors influencing judicial decision-making), their implicit conceptual commitments were decidedly positivistic in flavor.

b. Critical Legal Studies

The critical legal studies (CLS) movement attempts to expand the radical aspects of legal realism into a Marxist critique of mainstream liberal jurisprudence. CLS theorists believe the realists understate the extent of indeterminacy; whereas the realists believe that indeterminacy is local in the sense that it is confined to a certain class of cases, CLS theorists argue that law is radically (or globally) indeterminate in the sense that the class of available legal materials rarely, if ever, logically/causally entails a unique outcome.

CLS theorists emphasize the role of ideology in shaping the content of the law. On this view, the content of the law in liberal democracies necessarily reflects "ideological struggles among social factions in which competing conceptions of justice, goodness, and social and political life get compromised, truncated, vitiated, and adjusted" (Altman 1986, p. 221). The inevitable outcome of such struggles, on this view, is a profound inconsistency permeating the deepest layers of the law. It is this pervasive inconsistency that gives rise to radical indeterminacy in the law. For insofar as the law is inconsistent, a judge can justify any of a number of conflicting outcomes.

At the heart of the CLS critique of liberal jurisprudence is the idea that radical indeterminacy is inconsistent with liberal conceptions of legitimacy. According to these traditional liberal conceptions, the province of judges is to interpret, and not make, the law. For, on this view, democratic ideals imply that lawmaking must be left to legislators who, unlike appointed judges, are accountable to the electorate. But if law is radically indeterminate, then judges nearly always decide cases by making new law, which is inconsistent with liberal conceptions of the legitimate sources of lawmaking authority.

c. Law and Economics

The law and economics movement argues for the value of economic analysis in the law both as a description about how courts and legislators do behave and as a prescription for how such officials should behave. The legal economists, led by Richard Posner, argue that the content of many areas of the common law can be explained in terms of its tendency to maximize preferences:

[M]any areas of law, especially the great common law fields of property, torts, crimes, and contracts, bear the stamp of economic reasoning. It is not a refutation that few judicial opinions contain explicit references to economic concepts. Often the true grounds of decision are concealed rather than illuminated by the characteristic rhetoric of judicial opinions. Indeed, legal education consists primarily of learning to dig beneath the rhetorical surface to find those grounds, many of which may turn out to have an economic character (Posner 1992, p. 23).

Posner subscribes to the so-called efficiency theory of the common law, according to which "the common law is best (not perfectly) explained as a system for maximizing the wealth of society" (Posner 1992, p. 23).

More influential than Posner's descriptive claims is his normative view that law should strive to maximize wealth. According to Posner, the proper goal of the statutory and common law is to promote wealth maximization, which can best be done by facilitating the mechanisms of the free market. Posner's normative view combines elements of utilitarian analysis with a Kantian respect for autonomy. On the utilitarian side, markets tend to maximize wealth and the satisfaction of preferences. In a market transaction with no third-party effects, wealth is increased because all parties are made better off by the transaction-otherwise there would be no incentive to consummate the transaction-and no one is made worse off.

On the Kantian side, the law should facilitate market transactions because market transactions best reflect autonomous judgments about the value of individual preferences. At least ideally, individuals express and realize their preferences through mutually consensual market transactions consummated from positions of equal bargaining power. Thus, market transactions tend, ideally, to be both efficient (because they tend to maximize wealth without harmful third-party effects) and just (because all parties are consenting).

d. Outsider Jurisprudence

So-called "outsider jurisprudence" is concerned with providing an analysis of the ways in which law is structured to promote the interests of white males and to exclude females and persons of color. For example, one principal objective of feminist jurisprudence is to show how patriarchal assumptions have shaped the content of laws in a wide variety of areas: property, contract, criminal law, constitutional law, and the law of civil rights. Additionally, feminist scholars challenge traditional ideals of judicial decision-making according to which judges decide legal disputes by applying neutral rules in an impartial and objective fashion. Feminists have, of course, always questioned whether it is possible for judges to achieve an objective and impartial perspective, but now question whether the traditional model is even desirable.

Critical race theory is likewise concerned to point up the way in which assumptions of white supremacy have shaped the content of the law at the expense of persons of color. Additionally, critical race theorists show how the experience, concerns, values, and perspectives of persons of color are systematically excluded from mainstream discourse among practicing lawyers, judges, and legislators. Finally, such theorists attempt to show how assumptions about race are built into most liberal theories of law.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Andrew Altman (1986), "Legal Realism, Critical Legal Studies, and Dworkin," Philosophy and Public Affairs, vol. 15, no. 2, pp. 205-236.
  • Thomas Aquinas (1988), On Law, Morality and Politics (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co.).
  • John Austin (1977), Lectures on Jurisprudence and the Philosophy of Positive Law (St. Clair Shores, MI: Scholarly Press.
  • John Austin (1995), The Province of Jurisprudence Determined (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Randy E. Barnett (1977), "Restitution: A New Paradigm of Criminal Justice," Ethics, vol. 87, no. 4, pp. 279-301.
  • Jeremy Bentham (1988), A Fragment of Government (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Jeremy Bentham (1970), Of Laws In General (London: Athlone Press).
  • Brian Bix (1995), "Conceptual Questions and Jurisprudence," Legal Theory, vol. 1, no. 4 (December), pp. 465-479.
  • Brian Bix (1996a), Jurisprudence: Theory and Context (Boulder, CO: Westview Press).
  • Brian Bix (1996b), "Natural Law Theory," in Dennis M. Patterson (ed.), A Companion to Philosophy of Law and Legal Theory (Cambridge: Blackwell Publishing Co.).
  • William Blackstone (1979), Commentaries on the Law of England (Chicago: The University of Chicago Press).
  • Jules L. Coleman (1989), "On the Relationship Between Law and Morality," Ratio Juris, vol. 2, no. 1, pp. 66-78.
  • Jules L. Coleman (1982), "Negative and Positive Positivism," 11 Journal of Legal Studies vol. 139, no. 1, pp. 139-164.
  • Jules L. Coleman (1996), "Authority and Reason," in Robert P. George, The Autonomy of Law: Essays on Legal Positivism (Oxford: Clarendon Press), pp. 287-319.
  • Jules L. Coleman (1998), "Incorporationism, Conventionality and The Practical Difference Thesis," Legal Theory, vol. 4, no. 4, pp. 381-426.
  • Jules L. Coleman and Jeffrie Murphy (1990), Philosophy of Law (Boulder, CO: Westview Press).
  • Kimberle Crenshaw, Neil Gotanda, Gary Peller, and Kendall Thomas, eds. (1995), Critical Race Theory: The Key Writings That Formed the Movement (New York: The New Press).
  • Patrick Devlin (1965), The Enforcement of Morals (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Gerald Dworkin (1972), "Paternalism," The Monist, vol. 56, pp. 64-84.
  • Ronald Dworkin (1978), Taking Rights Seriously (Cambridge: Harvard University Press).
  • Ronald Dworkin (1982), "'Natural' Law Revisited," University of Florida Law Review vol. 34, no. 2, pp. 165-188.
  • Ronald Dworkin (1986), Law's Empire (Cambridge: Harvard University Press).
  • Joel Feinberg (1985), Offense to Others (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Joel Feinberg (1979), "Civil Disobedience in the Modern World," Humanities in Review, vol. 2, pp. 37-60.
  • John Finnis (1980), Natural Law and Natural Rights (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • William Fisher, Morton Horovitz, and Thomas Reed, eds. (1993), American Legal Realism (New York: Oxford University Press).
  • Jerome Frank (1930), Law and the Modern Mind (New York: Brentano's Publishing).
  • Lon L. Fuller (1964), The Morality of Law (New Haven, CT: Yale University Press).
  • Lon L. Fuller (1958), "Positivism and Fidelity to Law," Harvard Law Review, vol. 71, no. 4, pp. 630-672 .
  • Klaus Füßer (1996), "Farewell to 'Legal Positivism': The Separation Thesis Unravelling," in Robert P. George, The Autonomy of Law: Essays on Legal Positivism (Oxford: Clarendon Press), pp. 119-162.
  • John Chipman Gray (1921), The Nature and Source of Law (New York: Macmillan).
  • Kent Greenawalt (1987), Conflicts of Law and Morality (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • H.L.A. Hart (1994), The Concept of Law, 2nd Edition (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • H.L.A. Hart (1983), Essays in Jurisprudence and Philosophy (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • H.L.A. Hart (1963), Law, Liberty and Morality (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Kenneth Einar Himma (1998), "Positivism, Naturalism, and the Obligation to Obey Law," Southern Journal of Philosophy, vol. 36, no. 2, pp. 145-161.
  • Oliver Wendall Holmes (1898), "The Path of the Law," Harvard Law Review, vol. 110, no. 5, pp. 991-1009 .
  • Brian Leiter (1998), "Naturalism and Naturalized Jurisprudence," in Brian Bix (ed.), Analyzing Law: New Essays in Legal Theory (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • Brian Leiter, "Legal Realism," in Dennis M. Patterson, ed. (1996), A Companion to Philosophy of Law and Legal Theory (Oxford: Blackwell Publishers).
  • John Stuart Mill (1906), On Liberty (New York: Alfred A. Knopf).
  • Michael Moore (1992), "Law as a Functional Kind," in Robert P. George (ed.), Natural Law Theories: Contemporary Essays (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • Michael Moore, "The Moral Worth of Retribution," in Ferdinand Schoeman, ed. (1987), Responsibility, Character, and the Emotions (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Richard Posner (1992), Economic Analysis of Law, 4th Edition (Boston: Little, Brown, and Company).
  • John Rawls (1964), "Legal Obligation and the Duty of Fair Play," in Sidney Hook (ed.), Law and Philosophy (New York: New York University Press), pp. 3-18.
  • Joseph Raz (1979), The Authority of Law: Essays on Law and Morality (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • Joseph Raz (1980), The Concept of a Legal System: An Introduction to the Theory of Legal Systems, Second Edition (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • Roger Shiner (1992), Norm and Nature (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • M.B.E. Smith (1973), "Do We have a Prima Facie Obligation to Obey the Law," 82 Yale Law Journal 950-976.
  • Patricia Smith, ed. (1993), Feminist Jurisprudence (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • C.L. Ten (1987), Crime, Guilt, and Punishment (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • W.J. Waluchow (1994), Inclusive Legal Positivism (Oxford: Clarendon Press).

Author Information

Kenneth Einar Himma
Seattle Pacific University
U. S. A.

Feminist Jurisprudence

American feminist jurisprudence is the study of the construction and workings of the law from perspectives which foreground the implications of the law for women and women's lives. This study includes law as a theoretical enterprise as well its practical and concrete effects in women's lives. Further, it includes law as an academic discipline, and thus incorporates concerns regarding pedagogy and the influence of teachers. On all these levels, feminist scholars, lawyers, and activists raise questions about the meaning and the impact of law on women's lives. Feminist jurisprudence seeks to analyze and redress more traditional legal theory and practice. It focuses on the ways in which law has been structured (sometimes unwittingly) that deny the experiences and needs of women. Feminist jurisprudence claims that patriarchy (the system of interconnected relations and institutions that oppress women) infuses the legal system and all its workings, and that this is an unacceptable state of affairs. Consequently, feminist jurisprudence is not politically neutral, but a normative approach, as expressed by philosopher Patricia Smith: "[F]eminist jurisprudence challenges basic legal categories and concepts rather than analyzing them as given. Feminist jurisprudence asks what is implied in traditional categories, distinctions, or concepts and rejects them if they imply the subordination of women. In this sense, feminist jurisprudence is normative and claims that traditional jurisprudence and law are implicitly normative as well" (Smith 1993, p. 10). Feminist jurisprudence sees the workings of law as thoroughly permeated by political and moral judgments about the worth of women and how women should be treated. These judgments are not commensurate with women's understandings of themselves, nor even with traditional liberal conceptions of (moral and legal) equality and fairness.

Although feminist jurisprudence revolves around a number of questions and features a diversity of focus and approach, two characteristics are central to it. First, because the Anglo-American legal tradition is built on liberalism and its tenets, feminist jurisprudence tends to respond to liberalism in some way. The second characteristic is the goal of bringing the law and its practitioners to recognize that law as currently constructed does not acknowledge or respond to the needs of women, and must be changed. These two features can be seen in the major debates in current feminist jurisprudence, which range from questions of the proper perspective from which to understand the problems of the law, to questions of legal theory and practice.

Table of Contents

  1. Responding to Liberalism: Questions of Perspective
  2. Central Concerns: Questions of Theory and Practice
    1. Equality and Rights
    2. Understanding Harm
    3. The Processes of Adjudication
  3. Trajectories
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Responding to Liberalism: Questions of Perspective

As a critical theory, feminist jurisprudence responds to the current dominant understanding of legal thought, which is usually identified with the liberal Anglo-American tradition. (This tradition is represented by such authors as Hart 1961 and Dworkin 1977, 1986.) Two major branches of this tradition have been legal positivism, on the one hand, and natural law theory on the other. Feminist jurisprudence responds to both these branches of the American legal tradition by raising questions regarding their assumptions about the law, including:

  • that law is properly objective and thus must have recourse to objective rules or understandings at some level
  • that law is properly impartial, especially in that it is not to be tainted by the personal experience of any of its practitioners, particularly judges
  • that equality must function as a formal notion rather than a substantive one, such that in the eyes of the law, difference must be shown to be "relevant" in order to be admissible/visible
  • that law, when working properly, should be certain, and that the goal of lawmaking and legal decision-making is to gain certainty
  • that justice can be understood as a matter of procedures, such that a proper following of procedures can be understood as sufficient to rendering justice.

Each of these assumptions, although contested and debated, has remained a significant feature of the liberal tradition of legal understanding.

Feminist jurisprudence usually frames its responses to traditional legal thought in terms of whether or not the critic is maintaining some commitment to the tradition or some particular feature of it. This split in responses has been formulated in a number of different ways, according to the particular concerns they emphasize. The two formulations found most frequently in American feminist jurisprudence characterize the split either as the reformist/radical debate or as the sameness/difference debate. Within the reformist/radical debate, reformist feminists argue that the liberal tradition offers much that can be shaped to fit feminist hands and should be retained for all that it offers. These feminists approach jurisprudence with an eye to what needs to be changed within the system that already exists. Their work, then, is to gain entry into that system and use its own tools to construct a legal system which prevents the inequities of patriarchy from affecting justice.

Those who see the traditional system as either bankrupt or so problematic that it cannot be reshaped are often referred to as transformist or radical feminists. According to this approach, the corruption of the legal tradition by patriarchy is thought to be too deeply embedded to allow for any significant adjustments to the problems that women face. Feminists using this approach tend to argue that the legal system, either parts or as a whole, must be abandoned. They argue that liberal legal concepts, categories and processes must be rejected, and new ones put in place which can be free from the biases of the current system. Their work, then, is to craft the transformations that are necessary in legal theory and practice and to create a new legal system that can provide a more equitable justice.

Under the sameness/difference debate, the central concern for feminists is to understand the role of difference and how women's needs must be figured before the law. Sameness feminists argue that to emphasize the differences between men and women is to weaken women's abilities to gain access to the rights and protections that men have enjoyed. Their concern is that it is women's difference that has been used to keep women from enjoying a legal status equal to men's. Consequently, they see difference as a concept that must be de-emphasized. Sameness feminists work to highlight the ways in which women can be seen as the same as men, entitled to the same rights, protections, and privileges.

Difference feminists argue that (at least some of) the differences between men and women, as well as other types of difference such as race, age, and sexual orientation, are significant. These significant differences must be taken into account by the law in order for justice and equity to be achieved. What has been good law for men cannot simply be adopted by women, because women are not in fact the same as men. Women have different needs which require different legal remedies. The law must be made to recognize differences that are relevant to women's lives, status and possibilities.

The two characterizations of the debate about what perspective is best for understanding the problems of the law do share some features. Those who argue a sameness position are often thought to fit, to some degree, with the reformist view. Difference feminists are seen as sharing much with radicals. The parallel between the two characterizations is that both argue over how much, if any, of the current legal system can and must be preserved and put to use in the service of feminist concerns. The two characterizations are not the same, but the important parallel between them allows for some generalization regarding the ways in which each is likely to respond to particular theoretical and substantive issues. However, while the two may reasonably be grouped for some purposes, they must not be conflated.

From these perspectives, feminist jurisprudence emphasizes two kinds of question: the theoretical and the substantive. These two kinds of question are, perhaps especially for feminists, deeply connected and overlapping. Discussions of central theoretical issues in feminist jurisprudence are punctuated by elaboration of the substantive issues with which they are intertwined.

2. Central Concerns: Questions of Theory and Practice

In asking theoretical questions, feminists are concerned with how to understand the law itself, its proper scope, legitimacy, and meaning. Many of these are the questions of traditional legal theory, but asked in the context of the feminist project: What is the proper moral foundation of the law, especially given that any answer depends on the moral principles of the dominant structure of the society? What is the meaning of rule of law, especially given that obedience to law has been an important part of the history of subjugation? What is the meaning of equality, especially in a world of diversity? What is the meaning of harm, especially in a world in which women, not men, are subjected by men to certain kinds of violence? How can adjudication of conflict be properly and fairly achieved, especially when not all persons are able to come to the adjudication process on a "level playing field"? What is the meaning of property, and how can women avoid being categorized as property? Is law the best and most appropriate channel for the resolution of conflict, especially given its traditional grounding in patriarchal goals and structures?

Although feminists have addressed all these questions and more, perhaps one issue stands out in many feminists' eyes as a matter of special importance, encompassing as it does some aspect of many of the questions noted above. The issue that for many feminists is at the heart of concerns is that of equality and rights. Two others that may be considered nearly as central are problems of harm, and of the processes of adjudication.

a. Equality and Rights

Law works partly by drawing abstract guiding principles out of the specifics of the cases it adjudicates. On this abstract level, theoretical questions arise for feminist jurisprudence regarding equality and rights, including the following: what understanding of equality will make it possible for women to have control over their lives, in both the private and public spheres? What understanding of equality will provide an adequate grounding for the concept of rights, such that women's rights can protect both their individual liberty and their identity as women?

In general, the feminist concern with equality involves the claim that equality must be understood not simply as a formal concept that functions rhetorically and legally. Equality must be a substantive concept which can actually make changes in the power structure and the relative power positions of men and women generally. Although equality is examined in a wide variety of specific applications, the major concern is the goal of making equality meaningful in the lives of women. But for many feminists, concerns with equality cannot be addressed without also attending to rights. Because the liberal tradition figures rights as the hallmark of equality, it is in terms of rights that we are expected to see ourselves as equals before the law. Further, rights discourse has structured both our understanding of equality, and our claims to it.

Examinations of equality are, therefore, often framed by particular substantive issues. For example, much feminist jurisprudence regarding equality is framed in terms of concerns about work. If women are equal, then how will this be expressed in workplace law and policy? One of the key issues in this field has been how to treat pregnancy in the workplace: Is it fair for women to have extended or paid leave for pregnancy and birthing? Under what circumstances, or limitations? Are women being given "special" rights if they have a right to such leave? The struggle over the proper understanding of pregnancy and work raises questions about whether women should be treated in such law as individuals or as a class. As individuals, it has seemed relatively easy for workplaces to claim that not all employees are given such leave, and thus that women who do not are being treated "equally". One feminist strategy has been to attempt to revise such law to recognize the particular difference of women as a class. Herma Hill Kay, for example, argues that pregnancy can be seen as an episode which affects women's ability to take advantage of opportunities in the workplace, and that pregnant workers must be protected against loss of equal opportunity during episodes of pregnancy. (Kay, 1985)

Concerns over pregnancy express the fundamental questions of the sameness/difference debate. The sameness position suggests difference should be erased to the greatest extent possible, because it has been used as a basis for discrimination. Difference proponents argue that pregnancy involves significant differences which should be seen as a linchpin of legal understanding. Does equality mean that women should wish to be treated exactly the same as men, or does it mean that women should wish to be treated differently, because their differences are such that same treatment cannot provide equity?

Feminists who argue that equality requires creating for women the same opportunities and rights which are currently available to men of the ruling class are bringing the reformist or sameness approach to bear. Approaches to rights and equality which focus on women's individuality, emphasizing it in the way that law has done for men and requiring women to show that they are like men and thus may be treated like men, tend then to be reformist or sameness oriented. Because these approaches are seen as requiring that women become as much like men as possible, and that law treat women as it does men, they are often referred to as assimilationist.

Christine Littleton (Littleton, 1987) offers a further set of terms for approaches to understanding equality: symmetrical (paralleling reformist and sameness approaches) and asymmetrical (paralleling radical and difference approaches). This classification refers to how women and men are "located in society" with regard to issues, norms and rules. If a theorist sees men and women as sharing a location regarding an issue, then that theorist has a symmetrical approach; if not, then the approach is asymmetrical. Littleton classifies assimilationist approaches as symmetrical, along with what she calls the androgyny approach. The androgyny approach argues that men and women are very much alike, but that equality will require social institutions to pick a "mean" between the two, and apply that standard to all persons. This model is less frequently argued than the assimilation model.

There are also many radical and difference approaches to equality. What they share is the desire to avoid having to take on all that is questionable and/or undesirable about (society's construction of) men in order to be considered equal before the law. Thus many radical approaches (although not all - MacKinnon, below, is an example of one which is not) emphasize similar questions and problems as difference approaches. How to recognize relevant difference, and what kind of difference law must be responsive to, is a crucial part of these feminist examinations of equality. Ann Scales, for example, argues that liberal/reformist approaches do not do enough to really make the changes that are necessary, because the problem in equality is a problem of understanding how domination works. We must learn to see how equality has formally been tied in to domination through the liberal framework. In her view, a certain kind of inequality needs to be recognized and worked with, rather than ignored or assimilated. (Scales, 1986)

Other difference/radical approaches include the special rights, accommodation, acceptance, and empowerment models. (Littleton, 1987) The special rights model suggests that justice requires our recognizing that equality is too easily understood as "sameness", where men and women are not the same. Rights should be based on needs, and if women have needs that men do not, that should not limit their rights. The accommodation model asserts that differences which are not fundamental or biologically based should be treated under a symmetrical or assimilation model. But this leaves those differences which are fundamental (such as the ability to be pregnant) as differences which must be recognized in the law and accommodated by it.

Littleton's own approach is expressed in the acceptance model. This argues that (gender) difference must be accepted, and that law should focus on the consequences of such differences, rather than the differences themselves. Although differences exist between men and women, equality should function to make these differences "costless" relative to each other. Equality should function to prevent women's being penalized on the basis of their difference. Thus equality should require us to institute paid leave for pregnancy and birthing, and to guarantee women's return to their jobs after birthing.

Empowerment models reject difference as irrelevant, and shift focus to levels of empowerment. Equality, then, is understood as what balances power for groups and individuals, and dismantles the ability of some to dominate others. This radical and asymmetrical view does not, however, fit well with the categorization of feminist positions in terms of sameness and difference. The empowerment model's focus on domination and the ways in which power is distributed seems to represent a significant departure from the parallel suggested above. Thus some feminist jurists have suggested that it be understood as a separate approach. Judith Baer calls it simply the domination model of feminist jurisprudence. Catherine MacKinnon is one well-known scholar who holds this view. (MacKinnon, 1987) In her theorizing of pornography, for example, she focuses on the question of how power is used in pornography to maintain a structure of domination which belies the possibility of equality between men and women.

Feminist critiques of rights in general assert that rights have been apportioned based on notions of equality that deliberately exclude the needs of women. If rights are to be truly equal, they must be apportioned on a more equitable basis, informed by the experience of women and others previously excluded. Or, following MacKinnon or Patricia Williams (discussed below), rights must be apportioned based on how they empower those to whom they are granted. Feminist scholars debate the ground for understanding rights while working to create a foundation from which women can claim and exercise rights that will be meaningful in their lives.

b. Understanding Harm

Perhaps the most difficult question for feminist jurisprudence regarding the issue of harm is that of perspective: who defines and identifies harm in specific cases? Given that law has traditionally worked from a patriarchal perspective, it is perhaps not surprising that identifying harm to women has been problematic. A patriarchal system will benefit from a very stingy recognition of harms against women. Feminist jurisprudence, therefore, must examine the basic question, what is harm? It also must ask, what counts as harm in our legal system, and why? What has been excluded from definitions of harm that women need included, and how can such trends be overturned?

Three types of harm-causing actions that are typically and systematically directed against women have formed the background for discussion about what harm means, and what counts as harm: rape, sexual harassment, and battering. Until fairly recently (for example, before the legislative reform movements of the 1970s), some forms of these actions were not considered actionable offenses under the law. This was largely due to the history of understanding women not as independent and autonomous agents, but as property belonging to men (thus issues of the meaning of property are also crucial to understanding harm). Feminist jurisprudence has challenged this state of affairs. As a result, changes have been made in the laws regarding each of the three categories, although the effectiveness of these changes is widely disputed (see, e.g., Schulhofer 1998 for an excellent review of this law). At the very least, work by feminists has made it possible to speak of these harms by providing a vocabulary for them, by raising awareness about them, and by prosecuting them more frequently and with some success.

Discussions of rape attempt to answer many of the questions that apply to all three types of harm-causing actions. Cases of all three types give rise to similar problems that prevent women from being treated justly: blaming the victim; privileging the point of view of "the" agent, i.e., the male perpetrator; indicting the woman's sexual history while ignoring the man's history, whether sexual or violent. Underlying all these problems are assumptions about gender and agency which encourage the law to place responsibility for their own harm on women rather than on the men who cause it. Women have been believed to be mentally unstable or at least weak-minded, to be scheming and deceptive, and to have an improper motivation for making claims of harm against men. For these reasons, they tend to be seen as untrustworthy witnesses. Because they have been characterized as sexually insatiable and indiscriminate, they tend to be seen as deserving whatever harm they "provoke" from men. Corresponding assumptions about men's rational superiority encourage their being seen as believable witnesses. At the same time, assumptions about men's natural sexual needs are taken as justification for their violations of women. Feminist jurisprudence attempts to respond to these problems as double standards and matters of equality and rights.

Other issues of harm require different responses. Harm-causing actions tend to be defined in terms of external and observable characteristics (levels of force), of intention on the part of the agent (mens rea), and of the consent of the one harmed. Consequently, what is at issue is how law uses these criteria in determining both when harm has occurred and whether it is to be justified or excused. What feminist jurisprudence has found is that women and men frequently differ over the understanding of each of these criteria. But since it is a patriarchal understanding which grounds the law, women's understandings tend not to be given a proper hearing.

In Susan Estrich's discussion of rape (Estrich, 1987, 1987a), she claims that the mens rea criterion can be used to create either too much emphasis on the perpetrator's intention, or too little. In either case, she believes the focus on this criterion makes evident the law's lack of understanding of and concern for the harms women suffer. The law's focus is to not wrongly punish men, which is achieved at the cost of not protecting women.

Further, Estrich argues that the force criterion is understood from a patriarchal perspective: force is seen as a matter of what "boys do in schoolyards." This criterion figures force as a simple matter of the straightforward use of physical strength, or the use of implements of violence. But it ignores the kinds of force that are most frequently used in rape and other types of harm to women, such as psychological coercion. If the courts expect women to resist physical and psychological coercion in the same ways and at the same level that men do, then the courts impose an unreasonable expectation on the "reasonable" woman.

Regarding consent, Estrich explains that the courts have believed that if consent is given, then rape (or other harms) do not occur. This places responsibility on the one who has been harmed to show that she did not, in fact, consent. But patriarchal courts have held that only the strongest and most emphatic expression of non-consent functions as evidence. This means that in many cases, women have been said to have "consented" even though they were physically carried off by men and verbally expressed non-consent (Schulhofer 1998). Non-consent has not been easily proven unless the woman has been severely beaten, or unless a significant weapon (that is, gun or knife) was used, or death was threatened in a way that convinces the court. Thus what non-consent means for the court has been very different from what women themselves have said about (their) consent.

Robin West (West, 1988) argues along similar lines, claiming that women's social training does not impart the same fundamental values that men's training does. She theorizes that men value separation and autonomy to the point that they would physically fight, desperately, to maintain theirs. But because women value connection and relation most highly, they find it difficult to respond to physical violence with violence of their own. Violence destroys connection and relationship, which is what women are socialized to value most. This makes it difficult for women to respond to rape, and other harms, in a way which convinces masculine courts that they did not consent. Women's definition and identification of these harms is very different from what the courts have so far constructed.

It is difficult to separate out some parts of the reformist or sameness and radical or difference approaches with regard to harm. In general, however, those who argue that current laws can be changed to adequately protect women have reformist or sameness views. Those arguing that the current definitions of harm simply cannot be revised sufficiently have radical or difference views. Thus Estrich, who concludes that we need to treat rape as we treat other kinds of crime which require nonconsent (theft, for example) could be considered a reformist view. Mary Lou Fellows and Bev Balos offer a similar analysis of how women's perception of the harms of date rape can be accommodated in current law. This can be accomplished by the application of the heightened duty of care that exists already in the common law doctrine of confidential relationship. (Fellows and Balos, 1991) West's argument, based on recognizing and responding to fundamental differences between men and women regarding harm, could be seen as a radical or difference view. MacKinnon's analysis of sexual harassment, which focuses on the need for women to be empowered to define the harms against them, represents a dominance view on harms.

c. The Processes of Adjudication

Many feminist jurists challenge the processes of adjudication by raising questions about the neutrality or impartiality that such processes are assumed to embody. Neutrality is believed to function in the law in at least two ways. It is assumed to be built into the processes of the law, and it is assumed to be produced by those processes. Feminist jurisprudence challenges the first set of assumptions by raising questions about legal reasoning. It challenges the second by raising questions about how a law created and applied by partial and biased persons can itself be neutral. Thus feminist jurisprudence also raises the question of whether neutrality is a possible, or an appropriate, goal of the law.

As traditionally understood, neutrality in law is supposed to protect us from a number of ills. It protects from personal bias by insisting that judges, attorneys, law enforcement officers, etc., treat us not as people with specific characteristics, but as interchangeable subjects. We should be seen only in terms of certain specific actions and our intentions with regard to those specific actions. Officials are expected not to bring their personal biases to bear on those who come before them, and certain personal aspects of those brought before the law are not permitted to come under scrutiny. For example, if a judge personally believes that women are pathological liars, this is not supposed to influence his or her interpretation of any particular woman's testimony. Similarly, no person's race is supposed to influence any judge's understanding of their case. Feminist jurisprudence challenges such claims to neutrality.

Neutrality in law is supposed to protect against ideological bias as well. It does this by taking a supposedly universal perspective on a case, rather than a particular perspective. This belief that law and its practitioners can see, and judge, from the "view from nowhere" has been criticized by feminist jurisprudence. Feminists claim that such complete objectivity seems not to be fully possible. They also argue that claiming such neutrality deflects attention away from the fact that a partial view - a masculinist view - is being presented as universal. Feminist jurisprudence, like most feminist theory, rejects the claim of law that it is a neutral practice, and instead points to the ways in which law is clearly not neutral.

One of the ways law is not neutral is through the individual people that work in law. Feminist jurisprudence argues that because there is no such thing as the "view from nowhere", every understanding has a perspective. This perspective influences it, and provides an interpretive field for whatever matters of fact there may be. Since law is made, administered and enforced by people, and people must have a perspective, law must reflect those perspectives at least to some degree. Feminists tend to agree that to the extent that a practice or person is unaware of their own perspective, that perspective will more strongly influence their interpretations of the world. It is when we become aware of biases that we are able, through critical reflection, to reduce their influence and thus move toward a greater (although not a perfect) objectivity.

Another way that law is not neutral is in its content. Because it is made by people, many of whom have not critically examined their own standpoints, the content of law may be unfair or discriminatory. Such content would require officials to act in ways that are not impartial, or not fair. But even if law is written by those whose perspectives are relatively objective, our legislative system often imposes compromises on laws. Some compromises required to pass law may change or weaken its objectives in ways that prevent its functioning as intended. These criticisms show that the content of the law, affected by the contestations of our legislative system, may not be neutral. Further, it shows that the processes of the law do not guarantee the neutrality that they are assumed to do.

Neutrality is also assumed to be built into certain processes of the law, and in particular the processes of judicial reasoning. The traditional model of judicial decision-making relies on case law, which uses precedent and analogy to provide evidence and justification. Interpretation of statutes in prior cases provides precedent or rules. Courts then attempt to determine how the facts of current cases require one rule or another to be brought to bear. This way of making decisions has itself been thought to be neutral, and the formalities of due process that support it are thought to reinforce that neutrality. This feature of law, relying on past judgments to influence current and future ones, also makes it peculiarly resistant to change. For feminist jurisprudence, use of precedent allows the law to insulate itself against the critiques of outsiders, including women.

Use of precedent has been challenged by a feminist and non-feminist critiques, including the pragmatism of Margaret Radin (Radin, 1990) and Jerome Frank's legal realism (Frank, 1963). Feminist jurisprudence responds to use of precedent by pointing out those areas which are most likely to be subject to sexist understandings. For example, case law that has derived from cases in which plaintiffs and defendants are men will assume that the circumstances for those men are simply the "normal" circumstances. Workplace law has frequently been challenged by feminist critics for this reason. The law assumes, based on cases in which the workplace was populated mainly by men, that everyone who works shares men's circumstances. This assumption entails that workers are supported by a full-time homemaker, such that the burdens of home life and child rearing should not affect one's ability to function efficiently in the workplace. But such assumptions work against women, who usually are supporting someone else in this way rather than being supported.

Reform and sameness feminists argue that case law is not a bad system but that reforms are needed to emphasize to the realities of women's lives. Radical and difference feminists are more likely to argue that case law is itself a system that is too heavily entrenched in patriarchy to be maintained. Its reliance on precedent makes it too conservative a system of decision-making to be adequately brought to the service of feminism.

3. Trajectories

Although it seems that the sameness/difference and the reform/radical debates could create an impasse for feminists, some theorists believe that some combination of the two views can be more effective than either alone. Patricia Williams (Williams, 1991), for example, believes that rights can function as powerful liberatory tools for the traditionally disadvantaged. However, she also believes that in a racist society such as contemporary America, racial difference must be recognized because it creates disadvantage before the law. In this way, she claims that some features of the liberal tradition, like rights, need to be maintained for the liberatory work they can do. However, she argues that the liberal tradition of formal equality is damaging to historically marginalized groups. This aspect of law needs to be completely transformed.

As an example of the ways in which rights are still needed by the traditionally disadvantaged, she examines the relationship to rights that is enjoyed by a white male colleague. His sense of his rights is so entrenched that he sees them as creating distance between himself and others, and believes that rights should be played down. In contrast, Williams expresses her own relationship to rights, being a black woman, as much more tenuous. The history of American slavery, under which black Americans were literally owned by whites, makes it difficult for both blacks and whites to figure blacks as empowered by rights in the same ways that whites are.

This example shows how Williams weaves together important elements of both reform and radical positions, and at the same time includes the element of empowerment that is seen in dominance positions. She claims that for blacks, and for any traditionally disadvantaged group, rights are a significant part of a program of advancement. One's relationship to rights depends on who one is, and how one is empowered by one's society and law. For those whose rights are already guaranteed, what may be necessary for social change is to challenge the power of rights rhetoric for one's group. But for those whose rights have never been secure, this will not look like the best course of action. Williams' suggestion is that we recognize that rights and rights rhetoric function differently in different settings and for different people. But this, then, is a response which relies on the radical and difference premise that difference must in fact be attended to rather than elided. In order that rights be made effective for historically marginalized people, we must first see that they do not in fact function for all people in the way that they do for those they were created for.

Another approach to drawing the two sides of the debate in feminist jurisprudence together is offered by Judith Baer, whose claim is that feminist jurisprudence to date has failed to either reform or transform law because feminists in both camps have made crucial mistakes. (Baer, 1999) The primary error has been that feminist jurisprudence has tended to misunderstand the tradition it criticizes. Although feminist jurists recognize that the liberal tradition has secured rights for men but not women, they have failed to make explicit the corresponding asymmetry of responsibility. Women are accorded responsibility for themselves and others in ways that men are not. For example, women are expected to be responsible for the lives of children in ways that men are not; as noted above, this has implications in areas like workplace law.

The second major error Baer sees in feminist jurisprudence is that it, along with most feminism, has tended to focus almost exclusively on women. This has drawn feminist attention away from men and the institutions that feminism needs to study, criticize, challenge and change. It has also created a series of debates within feminism that are divisive and draining of feminist energy. Again, the solution is to recognize when reform (sameness) and radical (difference) approaches are effective, and to use each as appropriate. Baer argues that

[f]eminist jurists need not - indeed, we must not – choose between laws that treat men and women the same and laws that treat them differently. We already know that both kinds of law can be sexist. Our gender-neutral law of reproductive rights treats women worse than men, but so did "protective" labor legislation. Conversely, both gender-neutral and gender-specific laws can promote sexual equality. Comparable worth legislation would make women more nearly equal with men. So have affirmative action policies. Women can have it both ways. Law can treat men and women alike where they are alike and differently where they are different. (Baer 1999, 55)

Baer provides critiques of both reform and radical feminist jurisprudence. She concludes that neither alone is sufficient, but that both, applied where appropriate, could be. She argues that the feminist focus on women has encouraged an inability to think on a universal scale. This leaves feminists, and law under feminist jurisprudence, mired in the particularities of individual cases and individual traits. To move out of this mire, she suggests three tasks for feminist jurisprudence:

First, it must do the opposite of what conventional theory and feminist critiques have done: posit rights and question responsibility. Second, it must develop analyses that will separate situations from the people experiencing them, so we can talk about women's victimization without labeling them as victims. Finally, it must move beyond women and begin scrutinizing men and institutions. (Baer 1999, 68)

Baer does not suggest that feminism, nor feminist jurisprudence, should give up the study of women and women's situations. Rather, her suggestion is that this study as an exclusive focus is not sufficient for either reform or transformation. Because "women neither create nor sustain their position in society" feminists need to scrutinize those who do. Baer's suggestion is that what is needed is an account of "what it means to be a human being, a man, or a woman, which makes equality possible." (Baer 1999, 192) The mistakes that feminist jurisprudence has made have prevented its developing this account, which Baer thinks could be the foundation of what she calls a feminist postliberalism sufficient for feminist jurisprudence.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Baer, Judith A, Our Lives Before the Law: Constructing a Feminist Jurisprudence (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1999)
  • Cornell, Drucilla, Beyond Accommodation: Ethical Feminism, Deconstruction and the Law (New York: Routledge, 1990)
  • Dworkin, Andrea, Intercourse, (New York: The Free Press, 1987)
  • Dworkin, Ronald, Law's Empire (Cambridge: Harvaard University Press, 1986)
  • Dworkin, Ronald, Taking Rights Seriously (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1977)
  • Estrich, Susan, "Rape," 95 Yale Law Journal 1087-1184 (1987)
  • Estrich, Susan, Real Rape (Cambrdige: Harvard University Press, 1987a)
  • Fellows, Mary Louise and Beverly Balos, "Guilty of the Crime of Trust: Nonstranger Rape" 75 Minnesota Law Review 599 (1991)
  • Hart, H.L.A., The Concept of Law, (New York, Oxford University Press, 1961)
  • Jerome, Frank, Law and the Modern Mind (New York: Doubleday and Co., 1963)
  • Kay, Herma Hill, "Equality and Difference: The Case of Pregnancy," 1 Berkeley Women's Law Journal 1-37 (1985)
  • Littleton, Christine A., "Reconstructing Sexual Equality," 75 California Law Review 1279-1337 (1987)
  • MacKinnon, Catherine, Feminism Unmodified: Discourses on Life and Law (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1987)
  • Minow, Martha, Making All the Difference: Inclusion, Exclusion and American Law (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1991)
  • Radin, Margaret Jane, "The Pragmatist and the Feminist," 63 Southern California Law Review, 1699 (1990)
  • Scales, Ann C., "The Emergence of Feminist Jurisprudence: An Essay," 95 Yale Law Journal 1373-1403 (1986)
  • Schulhofer, Stephen J., Unwanted Sex: The Culture of Intimidation and the Failure of Law (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1998)
  • Smith, Patricia, ed., Feminist Jurisprudence (New York: Oxford University Press, 1993)
  • Tong, Rosemarie, Women, Sex and the Law (Totowa, NJ: Rowman and Littlefield, 1984)
  • West, Robin, "Jurisprudence and Gender," 55 University of Chicago Law Review 1 (1988)
  • Williams, Patricia, The Alchemy of Race and Rights (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1991)

Author Information

Melissa Burchard
University of North Carolina – Asheville
U. S. A.

Just War Theory

Just war theory deals with the justification of how and why wars are fought. The justification can be either theoretical or historical. The theoretical aspect is concerned with ethically justifying war and the forms that warfare may or may not take. The historical aspect, or the "just war tradition," deals with the historical body of rules or agreements that have applied in various wars across the ages. For instance, international agreements such as the Geneva and Hague conventions are historical rules aimed at limiting certain kinds of warfare which lawyers may refer to in prosecuting transgressors, but it is the role of ethics to examine these institutional agreements for their philosophical coherence as well as to inquire into whether aspects of the conventions ought to be changed. The just war tradition may also consider the thoughts of various philosophers and lawyers through the ages and examine both their philosophical visions of war’s ethical limits (or absence of) and whether their thoughts have contributed to the body of conventions that have evolved to guide war and warfare.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Jus Ad Bellum Convention
  3. The Principles Of Jus In Bello
  4. Jus post bellum
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Historically, the just war tradition--a set of mutually agreed rules of combat—may be said to commonly evolve between two culturally similar enemies. That is, when an array of values are shared between two warring peoples, we often find that they implicitly or explicitly agree upon limits to their warfare. But when enemies differ greatly because of different religious beliefs, race, or language, and as such they see each other as “less than human”, war conventions are rarely applied. It is only when the enemy is seen to be a people, sharing a moral identity with whom one will do business in the following peace, that tacit or explicit rules are formed for how wars should be fought and who they should involve and what kind of relations should apply in the aftermath of war. In part, the motivation for forming or agreeing to certain conventions, can be seen as mutually benefiting—preferable, for instance, to the deployment of any underhand tactics or weapons that may provoke an indefinite series of vengeance acts, or the kinds of action that have proved to be detrimental to the political or moral interests to both sides in the past.

Regardless of the conventions that have historically formed, it has been the concern of the majority of just war theorists that the lack of rules to war or any asymmetrical morality between belligerents should be denounced, and that the rules of war should apply to all equally. That is, just war theory should be universal, binding on all and capable in turn of appraising the actions of all parties over and above any historically formed conventions.

The just war tradition is indeed as old as warfare itself. Early records of collective fighting indicate that some moral considerations were used by warriors to limit the outbreak or to rein in the potential devastation of warfare. They may have involved consideration of women and children or the treatment of prisoners (enslaving them rather than killing them, or ransoming or exchanging them). Commonly, the earlier traditions invoked considerations of honor: some acts in war have always been deemed dishonorable, whilst others have been deemed honorable. However, what is “honorable” is often highly specific to culture: for instance, a suicidal attack or defense may be deemed the honorable act for one people but ludicrous to another. Robinson (2006) notes that honor conventions are also contextually slippery, giving way to pragmatic or military interest when required. Whereas the specifics of what is honorable differ with time and place, the very fact that one moral virtue is alluded to in the great literature (for example, Homer’s Iliad) is sufficient for us to note that warfare has been infused with some moral concerns from the beginning rather than war being a mere Macbethian bloodbath.

The just war theory also has a long history. Parts of the Bible hint at ethical behavior in war and concepts of just cause, typically announcing the justice of war by divine intervention; the Greeks may have paid lip service to the gods, but, as with the Romans, practical and political issues tended to overwhelm any fledgling legal conventions: that is, interests of state or Realpolitik (the theory known as political realism would take precedence in declaring and waging war. Nonetheless, this has also been the reading of political realists, who enjoy Thucydides’ History of the Peloponnesian War as an example of why war is necessarily the extension of politics and hence permeated by hard-nosed state interest rather than “lofty” pretensions to moral behavior.

Although St. Augustine provided comments on the morality of war from the Christian perspective (railing against the love of violence that war can engender) as did several Arabic commentators in the intellectual flourishing from the 9th to 12th centuries, but the most systematic exposition in the Western tradition and one that still attracts attention was outlined by Saint Thomas Aquinas in the 13th century. In the Summa Theologicae, Aquinas presents the general outline of what becomes the traditional just war theory as discussed in modern universities. He discusses not only the justification of war but also the kinds of activity that are permissible (for a Christian) in war (see below). Aquinas's thoughts become the model for later Scholastics and Jurists to expand and to gradually to universalize beyond Christendom – notably, for instance, in relations with the peoples of America following European incursions into the continent. The most important of these writers are: Francisco de Vitoria (1486-1546), Francisco Suarez (1548-1617), Hugo Grotius (1583-1645), Samuel Pufendorf (1632-1704), Christian Wolff (1679-1754), and Emerich de Vattel (1714-1767).

In the twentieth century, just war theory has undergone a revival mainly in response to the invention of nuclear weaponry and American involvement in the Vietnam war. The most important contemporary texts include Michael Walzer's Just and Unjust Wars (1977), Barrie Paskins and Michael Dockrill The Ethics of War (1979), Richard Norman Ethics, Killing, and War (1995), Brian Orend War and International Justice (2001) and Michael Walzer on War and Justice (2001), as well as seminal articles by Thomas Nagel "War and Massacre", Elizabeth Anscombe "War and Murder", and a host of others, commonly found in the journals Ethics or The Journal of Philosophy and Public Affairs.

Since the terrorist attacks on the USA on 9/11 in 2001, academics have turned their attention to just war once again with international, national, academic, and military conferences developing and consolidating the theoretical aspects of the conventions. Just war theory has become a popular topic in International Relations, Political Science, Philosophy, Ethics, and Military History courses. Conference proceedings are regularly published, offering readers a breadth of issues that the topic stirs: for example, Alexander Moseley and Richard Norman, eds. Human Rights and Military Intervention, Paul Robinson, ed., Just War in a Comparative Perspective, Alexsander Jokic, ed., War Crimes and Collective Wrongdoing. What has been of great interest is that in the headline wars of the past decade, the dynamic interplay of the rules and conventions of warfare not only remain intact on the battlefield but their role and hence their explication have been awarded a higher level of scrutiny and debate. In the political circles, justification of war still requires even in the most critical analysis a superficial acknowledgement of justification. On the ground, generals have extolled their troops to adhere to the rules, soldiers are taught the just war conventions in the military academies (for example, explicitly through military ethics courses or implicitly through veterans’ experiences). Yet despite the emphasis on abiding by war’s conventions, war crimes continue - genocidal campaigns have been waged by mutually hating peoples, leaders have waged total war on ethnic groups within or without their borders, and individual soldiers or guerilla bands have committed atrocious, murderous, or humiliating acts on their enemy. But, arguably, such acts do remain atrocities by virtue of the just war conventions that some things in war are deemed to be inexcusable, regardless of the righteousness of the cause or the noise and fog of battle.

Yet increasingly, the rule of law - the need to hold violators and transgressors responsible for their actions in war and therefore after the battle - is making headway onto the battlefield. In chivalrous times, the Christian crusader could seek priestly absolution for atrocities committed in war, a stance supported by Augustine for example; today, the law courts are seemingly less forgiving: a violation of the conventions assumes that the soldier is responsible and accountable and should be charged for a crime. Nonetheless, the idealism of those who seek the imposition of law and responsibility on the battlefield (cf. Geoffrey Robertson's Crimes Against Humanity), often runs ahead of the traditions and customs, or plain state interests, that demean or weaken the justum bellum that may exist between warring factions. And in some cases, no just war conventions and hence no potential for legal acknowledgement of malfeasance, exist at all; in such cases, the ethic of war is considered, or is implicitly held to be, beyond the norms of peaceful ethics and therefore deserving a separate moral realm where "fair is foul and foul is fair" (Shakespeare, Macbeth I.i). In such examples (e.g, Rwanda, 1994), a people's justification of destructiveness and killing to whatever relative degree they hold to be justifiable triumphs over attempts to establish the laws of peaceful interaction into this separate bloody realm; and in some wars, people fighting for their land or nation prefer to pick up the cudgel rather than the rapier, as Leo Tolstoy notes in War and Peace (Book 4.Ch.2), to sidestep the etiquette or war in favor securing their land from occupational or invading forces.

The continued brutality of war in the face of conventions and courts of international law lead some to maintain that the application of morality to war is a nonstarter: state interest or military exigency would always overwhelm moral concerns. But there are those of a more skeptical persuasion who do not believe that morality can or should exist in war: its very nature precludes ethical concerns. But as there are several ethical viewpoints, there are also several common reasons laid against the need or the possibility of morality in war. Generally, consequentialists and act utilitarians may claim that if military victory is sought then all methods should be employed to ensure it is gained at a minimum of expense and time. Arguments from 'military necessity' are of this type; for example, to defeat Germany in World War II, it was deemed necessary to bomb civilian centers, or in the US Civil War, for General Sherman to burn Atlanta. However, intrinsicists (who claim that there are certain acts that are good or bad in themselves) may also decree that no morality can exist in the state of war: they may claim that it can only exist in a peaceful situation in which, for instance, recourse exists to conflict resolving institutions. Alternatively, intrinsicists may claim that possessing a just cause (the argument from righteousness) is a sufficient condition for pursuing whatever means are necessary to gain a victory or to punish an enemy. A different skeptical argument, one advanced by Michael Walzer, is that the invention of nuclear weapons alters war so much that our notions of morality—and hence just war theories—become redundant. However, against Walzer, it can be reasonably argued that although such weapons change the nature of warfare (for example, the timing, range, and potential devastation) they do not dissolve the need to consider their use within a moral framework: a nuclear warhead remains a weapon and weapons can be morally or immorally employed.

Whilst skeptical positions may be derived from consequentialist and intrinsicist positions, they need not be. Consequentialists can argue that there are long-term benefits to having a war convention. For example, by fighting cleanly, both sides can be sure that the war does not escalate, thus reducing the probability of creating an incessant war of counter-revenges. Intrinsicists, on the other hand, can argue that certain spheres of life ought never to be targeted in war; for example, hospitals and densely populated suburbs.

The inherent problem with both ethical models is that they become either vague or restrictive when it comes to war. Consequentialism is an open-ended model, highly vulnerable to pressing military or political needs to adhere to any code of conduct in war: if more will be gained from breaking the rules than will be lost, the consequentialist cannot but demur to military “necessity.” On the other hand, intrinsicism can be so restrictive that it permits no flexibility in war: whether it entails a Kantian thesis of dutifully respecting others or a classical rights position, intrinsicism produces an inflexible model that would restrain warriors’ actions to the targeting of permissible targets only. In principle such a prescription is commendable, yet the nature of war is not so clean cut when military targets can be hidden amongst civilian centers.

Against these two ethical positions, just war theory offers a series of principles that aim to retain a plausible moral framework for war. From the just war (justum bellum) tradition, theorists distinguish between the rules that govern the justice of war (jus ad bellum) from those that govern just and fair conduct in war (jus In bello) and the responsibility and accountability of warring parties after the war (jus post bellum). The three aspects are by no means mutually exclusive, but they offer a set of moral guidelines for waging war that are neither unrestricted nor too restrictive. The problem for ethics involves expounding the guidelines in particular wars or situations.

2. The Jus Ad Bellum Convention

The principles of the justice of war are commonly held to be: having just cause, being a last resort, being declared by a proper authority, possessing right intention, having a reasonable chance of success, and the end being proportional to the means used. One can immediately detect that the principles are not wholly intrinsicist nor consequentialist—they invoke the concerns of both models. Whilst this provides just war theory with the advantage of flexibility, the lack of a strict ethical framework means that the principles themselves are open to broad interpretations. Examining each in turn draws attention to the relevant problems.

Possessing just cause is the first and arguably the most important condition of jus ad bellum. Most theorists hold that initiating acts of aggression is unjust and gives a group a just cause to defend itself. But unless "aggression" is defined, this proscription is rather open-ended. For example, just cause resulting from an act of aggression can ostensibly be a response to a physical injury (for example, a violation of territory), an insult (an aggression against national honor), a trade embargo (an aggression against economic activity), or even to a neighbor’s prosperity (a violation of social justice). The onus is then on the just war theorist to provide a consistent and sound account of what is meant by just cause. Whilst not going into the reasons why the other explanations do not offer a useful condition of just cause, the consensus is that an initiation of physical force is wrong and may justly be resisted. Self-defense against physical aggression, therefore, is putatively the only sufficient reason for just cause. Nonetheless, the principle of self-defense can be extrapolated to anticipate probable acts of aggression, as well as in assisting others against an oppressive government or from another external threat (interventionism). Therefore, it is commonly held that aggressive war is only permissible if its purpose is to retaliate against a wrong already committed (for example, to pursue and punish an aggressor), or to pre-empt an anticipated attack. In recent years, the argument for preemption has gained supporters in the West: surely, the argument goes, it is right on consequentialist grounds to strike the first blow if a future war is to be avoided? By acting decisively against a probable aggressor, a powerful message is sent that a nation will defend itself with armed force; thus preemption may provide a deterrent and a more peaceful world. However, critics complain that preemptive strikes are based on conjectured rather than impending aggression and in effect denounce the moral principle that an agent is presumed innocent – posturing and the building up of armaments do not in themselves constitute aggression, just a man carrying a weapon is not a man using a weapon, Consequentialist critics may also reject preemption on the grounds that it is more likely to destabilize peace, while other realists may complain that a preemptive strike policy is the ploy of a tyrannical or bullying power that justifies other nations to act in their self-interest to neutralize either through alliances or military action – such is the principle behind the “balance of power” politics in which nations constantly renew their alliances and treatises to ensure that not one of them becomes a hegemonic power. It is also feared that the policy of preemption slips easily into the machinations of “false flag operations” in which a pretext for war is created by a contrived theatrical or actual stunt – of dressing one’s own soldiers up in the enemy’s uniforms, for instance, and having them attack a military or even civilian target so as to gain political backing for a war. Unfortunately, false flag operations tend to be quite common. Just war theory would reject them as it would reject waging war to defend a leader’s “honor” following an insult. Realists may defend them on grounds of a higher necessity but such moves are likely to fail as being smoke screens for political rather than moral interests.

War should always be a last resort. This connects intimately with presenting a just cause – all other forms of solution must have been attempted prior to the declaration of war. It has often been recognized that war unleashes forces and powers that soon get beyond the grips of the leaders and generals to control – there is too much “fog” in war, as Clausewitz noted, but that fog is also a moral haze in which truth and trust are early casualties. The resulting damage that war wrecks tends to be very high for most economies and so theorists have advised that war should not be lightly accepted: once unleashed, war is not like a sport that can be quickly stopped at the blow of a whistle (although the Celtic druids supposedly had the power to stop a battle by virtue of their moral standing) and its repercussions last for generations. Holding “hawks” at bay though is a complicated task – the apparent ease by which war may resolve disputes, especially in the eyes of those whose military might is apparently great and victory a certainty, does present war as a low cost option relative to continuing political problems and economic or moral hardship. Yet the just war theorist wishes to underline the need to attempt all other solutions but also to tie the justice of the war to the other principles of jus ad bellum too.

The notion of proper authority seems to be resolved for most of the theorists, who claim it obviously resides in the sovereign power of the state. But the concept of sovereignty raises a plethora of issues to consider here. If a government is just, i.e., most theorists would accept that the government is accountable and does not rule arbitrarily, then giving the officers of the state the right to declare war is reasonable, so the more removed from a proper and just form a government is, the more reasonable it is that its claim to justifiable political sovereignty disintegrates. A historical example can elucidate the problem: when Nazi Germany invaded France in 1940 it set up the Vichy puppet regime. What allegiance did the people of France under its rule owe to its precepts and rules? A Hobbesian rendition of almost absolute allegiance to the state entails that resistance is wrong (so long as the state is not tyrannical and imposes war when it should be the guardian of peace); whereas a Lockean or instrumentalist conception of the state entails that a poorly accountable, inept, or corrupt regime possesses no sovereignty, and the right of declaring war (to defend themselves against the government or from a foreign power) is wholly justifiable. The notion of proper authority therefore requires thinking about what is meant by sovereignty, what is meant by the state, and what is the proper relationship between a people and its government.

The possession of right intention is ostensibly less problematic. The general thrust of the concept being that a nation waging a just war should be doing so for the cause of justice and not for reasons of self-interest or aggrandizement. Putatively, a just war cannot be considered to be just if reasons of national interest are paramount or overwhelm the pretext of fighting aggression. However, “right intention” masks many philosophical problems. According to Kant, possessing good intent constitutes the only condition of moral activity, regardless of the consequences envisioned or caused, and regardless, or even in spite, of any self interest in the action the agent may have. The extreme intrinsicism of Kant can be criticized on various grounds, the most pertinent here being the value of self-interest itself. At what point does right intention separate itself from self-interest – is the moral worthiness of intent only gained by acting in favor of one’s neighbor, and if so, what does that imply for moral action – that one should woo one’s neighbor’s spouse to make him/her feel good? Acting with proper intent requires us to think about what is proper and it is not certain that not acting in self interest is necessarily the proper thing to do. On the one hand, if the only method to secure a general peace (some thing usually held to be good in itself) is to annex a belligerent neighbor's territory, political aggrandizement becomes intimately connected with the proper intention of maintaining the peace for all or the majority. On the other hand, a nation may possess just cause to defend an oppressed group, and may rightly argue that the proper intention is to secure their freedom, yet such a war may justly be deemed too expensive or too difficult to wage; i.e., it is not ultimately in their self-interest to fight the just war. On that account, the realist may counter that national interest is paramount: only if waging war on behalf of freedom is also complemented by the securing of economic or other military interests should a nation commit its troops. The issue of intention raises the concern of practicalities as well as consequences, both of which should be considered before declaring war.

The next principle is that of reasonable success. This is another necessary condition for waging just war, but again is insufficient by itself. Given just cause and right intention, the just war theory asserts that there must be a reasonable probability of success. The principle of reasonable success is consequentialist in that the costs and benefits of a campaign must be calculated. However, the concept of weighing benefits poses moral as well as practical problems as evinced in the following questions. Should one not go to the aid of a people or declare war if there is no conceivable chance of success? Is it right to comply with aggression because the costs of not complying are too prohibitive? Would it be right to crush a weak enemy because it would be marginally costless? Is it not sometimes morally necessary to stand up to a bullying larger force, as the Finns did when Russia invaded in 1940, for the sake of national self-esteem or simple interests of defending land? Historically, many nations have overcome the probability of defeat: the fight may seem hopeless, but a charismatic leader or rousing speech can sometimes be enough to stir a people into fighting with all their will. Winston Churchill offered the British nation some of the finest of war's rhetoric when it was threatened with defeat and invasion by Nazi Germany in 1940. For example: "Let us therefore brace ourselves to do our duty, and so bear ourselves that, if the British Commonwealth and its Empire lasts for a thousand years, men will still say, 'This was their finest hour.’“ ….And “What is our aim?….Victory, victory at all costs, victory in spite of all terror; victory, however long and hard the road may be; for without victory, there is no survival." (Speeches to Parliament, 1940). However, the thrust of the reasonable success principle emphasizes that human life and economic resources should not be wasted in what would obviously be an uneven match. For a nation threatened by invasion, other forms of retaliation or defense may be available, such as civil disobedience, or even forming alliances with other small nations to equalize the odds.

The final guide of jus ad bellum is that the desired end should be proportional to the means used. This principle overlaps into the moral guidelines of how a war should be fought, namely the principles of jus In bello. With regards to just cause, a policy of war requires a goal, and that goal must be proportional to the other principles of just cause. Whilst this commonly entails the minimizing of war's destruction, it can also invoke general balance of power considerations. For example, if nation A invades a land belonging to the people of nation B, then B has just cause to take the land back. According to the principle of proportionality, B’s counter-attack must not invoke a disproportionate response: it should aim to retrieve its land and not exact further retribution or invade the aggressor’s lands, or in graphic terms it should not retaliate with overwhelming force or nuclear weaponry to resolve a small border dispute. That goal may be tempered with attaining assurances that no further invasion will take place, but for B to invade and annex regions of A is nominally a disproportionate response, unless (controversially) that is the only method for securing guarantees of no future reprisals. For B to invade and annex A and then to continue to invade neutral neighboring nations on the grounds that their territory would provide a useful defense against other threats and a putative imbalance of power is even more unsustainable.

On the whole the principles offered by jus ad bellum are useful guidelines for reviewing the morality of going to war that are not tied to the intrinsicist’s absolutism or consequentialist’s open-endedness. Philosophically however they invoke a plethora of problems by either their independent vagueness or by mutually inconsistent results – a properly declared war may involve improper intention or disproportionate ambitions. But war is a complicated issue and the principles are nonetheless a useful starting point for ethical examination and they remain a guide for both statesmen and women and for those who judge political proceedings.

3. The Principles Of Jus In Bello

The rules of just conduct within war fall under the two broad principles of discrimination and proportionality. The principle of discrimination concerns who are legitimate targets in war, whilst the principle of proportionality concerns how much force is morally appropriate. A third principle can be added to the traditional two, namely the principle of responsibility, which demands an examination of where responsibility lies in war.

One strong implication of the justice of warfare being a separate topic of analysis to the justice of war is that the theory thus permits the judging of acts within war to be dissociated from it cause. This allows the theorist to claim that a nation fighting an unjust cause may still fight justly, or a nation fighting a just cause may be said to fight unjustly. It is a useful division but one that does not necessarily sever all ties between the two great principles of warfare: the justice of a cause remains a powerful moral guide by which warfare is to be judged, for what does it matter, it can be asked, if a nation wages a war of aggression but does so cleanly?

In waging war it is considered unfair and unjust to attack indiscriminately since non-combatants or innocents are deemed to stand outside the field of war proper. Immunity from war can be reasoned from the fact that their existence and activity is not part of the essence of war, which is the killing of combatants. Since killing itself is highly problematic, the just war theorist has to proffer a reason why combatants become legitimate targets in the first place, and whether their status alters if they are fighting a just or unjust war. Firstly, a theorist may hold that being trained and/or armed constitutes a sufficient threat to combatants on the other side and thereby the donning of uniform alters the person’s moral status to legitimate target; whether this extends to peaceful as well as war duties is not certain though. Voluntarists may invoke the boxing ring analogy: punching another individual is not morally supportable in a civilized community, but those who voluntarily enter the boxing ring renounce their right not to be hit. Normally, a boxer does not retain the right to hit another boxer outside of the ring, yet perhaps a soldier’s training creates a wholly different expectation governing his or her status and that wearing the uniform or merely possessing the training secures their legitimacy as a target both on and off the battlefield. Such an argument would imply that it is right to attack unarmed soldiers or soldiers who have surrendered or who are enjoying the normality of civilian life, which just war theorists and historical conventions have traditionally rejected on the claim that when a soldier lays down his weapons or removes his uniform, he or she returns to civilian life and hence the status of the non-combatant even if that return is temporary. Conversely, in joining an army the individual is said to renounce his or her rights not to be targeted in war – the bearing of arms takes a person into an alternative moral realm in which killing is the expectation and possible norm: it is world removed from civilian structures and historically has evolved rites of passage and exit that underline the alteration in status for cadets and veterans; all analogies to the fair play of sports fail at this juncture, for war involves killing and what the British Army call “unlimited liability.” On entering the army, the civilian loses the right not to be targeted, yet does it follow that all who bear uniform are legitimate targets, or are some more so than others – those who are presently fighting compared to those bearing arms but who are involved in supplies or administration, for instance?

Others, avoiding a rights analysis for it produces many problems on delineating the boundaries of rights and the bearers, may argue that those who join the army (or who have even been pressed into conscription) come to terms with being a target, and hence their own deaths. This is argued for example by Barrie Paskins and Michael Dockrill in The Ethics of War (1979). However, since civilians can just as readily come to terms with their own deaths and it is not necessarily the case that a soldier has, their argument, although interesting, is not sufficient to defend the principle of discrimination and why soldiers alone should be targeted legitimately in war. In turn, rights-based analyses may be more philosophically productive in giving soldiers and critics crucial guidelines, especially those analyses that focus on the renouncing of rights by combatants by virtue of their war status, which would leave nominally intact a sphere of immunity for civilians. Yet what is the status of guerrilla fighters who use civilian camouflage in order to press their attacks or to hide? Similarly, soldiers on covert operations present intricate problems of identification and legitimization: is there a difference between the two? Referring back to the fighters’ cause (for example, the guerrilla is a “freedom fighter” and thus carries a moral trump card) creates its own problems, which the just war theory in dividing the justice of the cause from the justice of the manner in which war is fought attempts to avoid: the guerrilla fighter may breach codes of conduct just as the soldier on a politically sensitive covert operations may avoid targeting the wrong people.

Walzer, in his Just and Unjust Wars (1977) claims that the lack of identification does not give a government the right to kill indiscriminately—the onus is on the government to identify the combatants, and so, the implication goes, if there is any uncertainty involved then an attack must not be made. Others have argued that the nature of modern warfare dissolves the possibility of discrimination: civilians are just as necessary causal conditions for the war machine as are combatants, therefore, they claim, there is no moral distinction in targeting an armed combatant and a civilian involved in arming or feeding the combatant. The distinction is, however, not closed by the nature of modern economies, since a combatant still remains a very different entity from a non-combatant, if not for the simple reason that the former is presently armed (and hence has renounced rights or is prepared to die, or is a threat), whilst the civilian is not. On the other hand, it can be argued that being a civilian does not necessarily mean that one is not a threat and hence not a legitimate target. If Mr Smith is the only individual in the nation to possess the correct combination that will detonate a device that could kill thousands, then he becomes not only causally efficacious in the firing of a weapon of war, but also morally responsible; reasonably he also becomes a legitimate military target. His job effectively militarizes his status even though he does not bear arms.

The underlying issues that ethical analysis must deal with involve the logical nature of an individual's complicity and the aiding and abetting the war machine, with greater weight being imposed on those logically closer than those logically further from the war machine in their work. At a deeper level, one can consider the role that civilians play in supporting an unjust war: to what extent are they morally culpable, and if they are culpable in giving moral, financial, or economic support to some extent, does that mean they may become legitimate targets? This invokes the issue of collective versus individual responsibility that is in itself a complex topic but one that the principle of discrimination tries to circumvent by presenting guidelines for soldiers that keep their activity within the realms of war and its effects rather than murder. It would be wrong, on the principle of discrimination, to group the enemy into one targetable mass of people – some can not be responsible for a war or its procedures, notably children. Yet, on the other hand, if a civilian bankrolls a war or initiates aggression as a politician, surely he or she bears some moral responsibility for the ensuing deaths: some may argue that the war’s justification rests upon such shoulders but not the manner in which it is fought, while others may prefer to saddle the leader or initiator with the entire responsibility for how a war is fought on the argument that each combatant is responsible for those below him or her in rank – so the political or civilian leaders are analogously responsible for all operating in the military field.

The second principle of just conduct is that any offensive action should remain strictly proportional to the objective desired. This principle overlaps with the proportionality principle of just cause, but it is distinct enough to consider it in its own light. Proportionality for jus In bello requires tempering the extent and violence of warfare to minimize destruction and casualties. It is broadly utilitarian in that it seeks to minimize overall suffering, but it can also be understood from other moral perspectives, for instance, from harboring good will to all (Kantian ethics), or acting virtuously (Aristotelian ethics). Whilst the consideration of discrimination focuses on who is a legitimate target of war, the principle of proportionality deals with what kind of force is morally permissible. In fighting a just war in which only military targets are attacked, it is still possible to breach morality by employing disproportionate force against an enemy. Whilst the earlier theoreticians, such as Thomas Aquinas, invoked the Christian concepts of charity and mercy, modern theorists may invoke either consequentialist or intrinsicist prescriptions, both of which remain problematic as the foregoing discussions have noted. However, it does not seem morally reasonable to completely gun down a barely armed albeit belligerent tribe. At the battle of Omdurman in 1898 in the Sudan, six machine gunners killed thousands of dervishes—the gunners may have been in the right to defend themselves, but the principle of proportionality implies that a battle end before it becomes a massacre. Similarly, following the battle of Culloden in 1746 in Scotland, Cumberland ordered "No Quarter", which was not only a breach of the principle of discrimination, for his troops were permitted to kill the wounded as well as supporting civilians, but also a breach of the principle of proportionality, since the battle had been won, and the Jacobite cause effectively defeated on the battle field.

What if a war and all of its suffering could be avoided by highly selective killing? Could just war theory endorse assassination for instance? Assassination programs have often been secretly accepted and employed by states throughout the centuries and appeal, if challenged, is often to a “higher” value such as self-defense, killing a target guilty of war crimes and atrocities, or removing a threat to peace and stability. The CIA manual on assassination (1954, cf. Belfield), sought to distinguish between murder and assassination, the latter being justifiable according to the higher purposes sought. This is analogous to just war theorists seeking to put mass killing on a higher moral ground than pure massacre and slaughter and is fraught with the same problems raised in this article and in the just war literature. On grounds of discrimination, assassination would be justifiable if the target were legitimate and not, say, the wife or children of a legitimate target. On grounds of proportionality, the policy would also be acceptable, for if one man or woman (a legitimate target by virtue of his or her aggression) should die to avoid further bloodshed or to secure a quicker victory, then surely assassination is covered by the just war theory? The founder of the Hashshashin society (c.11-13thC), Hasan ibn el Sabah preferred to target or threaten warmongers rather than drag innocents and noncombatants into bloody and protracted warfare: his threats were often successful for he brought the reality of death home to the leaders who otherwise would enjoy what lyricist Roger Waters calls “the bravery of being out of range.” In recent years, the US and UK proclaimed that the war in the Gulf was not with the Iraqi people but with its leader and his regime; the US government even issued a bounty on the heads of key agents in the Ba’ath party; indeed, Saddam Hussein’s sons, Uday and Qusay with a bounty of £15m, were killed in a selective hunt and destroy mission rather than being captured and brought to trial for the crimes asserted of them. Assassination would apparently clear the two hurdles of discrimination and proportionality, yet the intrinsicist wing of just war theorists would reasonably claim that underhand and covert operations, including assassination, should not form a part of war on grounds that they act to undermine the respect due one’s enemy (not matter how cruel he or she is) as well as the moral integrity of the assassin; the consequentialists would also counter that such policies also encourage the enemy to retaliate in similar manner, and one of the sustaining conclusions of just war theory is that escalation or retaliatory measures (tit for tat policies) should be avoided for their destabilizing nature. Once initiated, assassination tends to become the norm of political affairs – indeed, civil politics would thus crumble into fearful and barbaric plots and conspiracies (as did Rome in its last centuries) in a race to gain power and mastery over others rather than to forge justifiable sovereignty.

The principles of proportionality and discrimination aim to temper war's violence and range; while they may ostensibly imply the acceptance of some forms of warfare, their malleability also implies that we continuously look afresh upon seemingly acceptable acts. Accordingly, they are complemented by other considerations that are not always explicitly taken up in the traditional exposition of jus In bello, this is especially true in the case of the issue of responsibility.

Jus in bello requires that the agents of war be held responsible for their actions. This ties in their actions to morality generally. Some, such as Saint Augustine argues against this assertion: "who is but the sword in the hand of him who uses it, is not himself responsible for the death he deals." Those who act according to a divine command, or even God's laws as enacted by the state and who put wicked men to death “have by no means violated the commandment, 'Thou shalt not kill.’” Whilst this issue is connected to the concepts of just cause, it does not follow that individuals waging a just, or unjust war, should be absolved of breaching the principles of just conduct. Readily it can be accepted that soldiers killing other soldiers is part of the nature of warfare for which soldiers ought to be prepared and trained, but when soldiers turn their weapons against non-combatants, or pursue their enemy beyond what is reasonable, then they are no longer committing legitimate acts of war but acts of murder. The principle of responsibility re-asserts the burden of abiding by rules in times of peace on those acting in war to remind them that one day they will once more take up civilian status and should be prepared to do so conscientiously, free of any guilt from war crimes. The issues that arise from this principle include the morality of obeying orders (for example, when one knows those orders to be immoral), as well as the moral status of ignorance (not knowing of the effects of one’s actions either reasonably or literally).

Responsibility for acts of war relate back to the tenets of jus ad bellum as well as jus in bello, for the justification of going to war involves responsibility as well as the acts ordered and committed in war. In reviewing the stories from military ethics readers, the acts of bravery that attract our attention involve soldiers standing up to do the “right thing” against either the prevailing momentum of the platoon or the orders from higher up; the realist rejects such acts as infrequent or unnecessary performances that do not alter the main characteristic of war and its innate brutality, yet such acts also remind the critic as well as the soldier of the importance of returning to the civilian mode with good conscience.

The aftermath of war involves the relinquishing of armed conflict as a means of resolving disputes and the donning of more civil modes of conduct but it also raises questions concerning the nature of the post bellum justice.

4. Jus post bellum

Following the cessation of a war, three possibilities emerge: either the army has been defeated, has been victorious, or it has agreed to a ceasefire. Principles of justice may then be applied to each situation. Orend presents a useful summary of the principles of jus post bellum : the principle of discrimination should be employed to avoid imposing punishment on innocents or non-combatants; the rights or traditions of the defeated deserve respect; the claims of victory should be proportional to the war’s character; compensatory claims should be tempered by the principles of discrimination and proportionality; and, controversially, the need to rehabilitate or re-educate an aggressor should also be considered.

It has often been remarked that justice, like history, is written by the victors. A defeated army and indeed the civilian body from which the army stems should thus be prepared to subject itself to the imposition of rules and forms of punishments, humiliation, and even retributions that it would not otherwise agree to. The lives, values, and resources that have been fought for must now be handed over to the conquerors. When put this way, when one readily imagines one’s own country’s army falling to an aggressive enemy, the terms immediately appear fearful and unjust and may stir a greater endeavor to make the victory hollow by the raising of guerrilla or even terrorist organizations to thwart the conquerors’ designs.

Yet when one’s own army is victorious, the partiality of victory can be so easily dismissed on the enthusiastic wave that accompanies triumph: victory is so often associated with the greater right when one’s own country vanquishes its enemy, and assumedly with that right comes the justification to impose conditions upon the vanquished. In so many wars in history, both ancient and modern, victory has provided the winners with the means of exploiting the defeated nation and for claiming rights over its lands and people whether in the form of enslavement or in monopolistic mercantile contracts; sometimes an appeal to divine justice is made; at other times the supremacy of one’s nation, race, creed, or political order is lauded over the defeated. Economic exploitation is not the only means of subjugating the defeated: new political or religious frameworks can also be imposed sometimes as a means of “rehabilitating the defeated” or as a means to avoid the circumstances (political or economic) that may bring about further warfare; the philosopher must naturally inquire as to the justice of such measures.

The just war theorist is keen to remind warriors and politicians alike that the principles of justice following war should be universalizable and morally ordered and that victory should not provide a license for imposing unduly harsh or punitive measures or that state or commercial interests should not dictate the form of the new peace. Similarly, imposing an alternative political or religious is not likely to be conducive to peace, as Edmund Burke prophetically warned about decreeing for the “rights of man” in an unprepared culture; re-educating a defeated military or bureaucracy may seem reasonable and arguably was successful in post-war Germany (1945), yet such a program may also be so superficial or condescending as to have only short term and illusory benefits or act to further humiliate the defeated into seething desire for revenge. In post-war Iraq (2003-date), the rehabilitation programs have met with mixed success and have often been criticized for favoring some ethnic groups over others, i.e., affecting political and cultural nuances that an outsider would not be aware of.

Criticism may stem from either intrinsicist reasons (that the defeated should still be viewed as a people deserving moral respect and their traditions held as sacrosanct) or consequentialist reasons (that punitive impositions are likely to produce a backlash); but again it is worth reminding that just war theory tends to merge the two to avoid awkward implications derived from either position singly.

At this point, the attraction for jus post bellum thinkers is to return to the initial justice of the war. Consider a war of self-defense: this is considered by most, except absolute pacifists, to be the most justifiable of all wars. If the people are defeated but their cause remains just, should they then continue the fight to rid their country of all the vestiges of occupation? What if fighting is impossible? Should they bow their heads in honorable defeat and accept the victor’s terms graciously? Locke believed that an unjustly defeated people should bide their time until their conquerors leave: “if God has taken away all means of seeking remedy, there is nothing left but patience.” (Second Treatises, §177); however, the right always remains with those who fought against an unjust war but they do not gain any moral right to attack indiscriminately or disproportionately (such as terrorizing the invader’s own civilians or soldiers at rest), although they may carry on their claim for freedom over the generations. A realist, however, may ask how a people are to regain their freedom if they do not raise arms against their sea of troubles? Nonetheless, if the “good fight” is to continue, most theorists follow Locke and prohibit breaches of the jus in bello principles: while it would be wrong to bow to a tyrant or conquering army, it would be immoral to target their families in order to encourage the occupying army to leave. Others may counsel civil disobedience and other forms of intransigence to signal displeasure.

If, on the other hand, the victors have won a just war against an aggressor, Locke argues that the victor’s right does not extend to the aggressive nation’s civilian population, but that it does extend to all those engaged in the aggression and that it extends absolutely: that is, the just conqueror has absolute rights of life and death over the defeated aggressors. The aggressor, one who initiates war, puts the individual or the community into a state of war, he argues, and so the defender has an absolute prerogative to use whatever force necessary to secure freedom and peace: accordingly, in victory, the victors may enslave or kill the aggressors. Locke’s is an extreme although not logically incoherent position and his exhortations may be compared to other moral positions (often emerging from religious thinking) to temper the justice in favor of other virtues such as charity, liberality, and justice. Indeed, King Alfred the Great of Wessex (c.878AD) defeated the Viking invader Guthrum in battle and rather than executing him as the Vikings would have done Alfred, he ordered them to join the Christian religion and then, and probably more importantly, offered them a stake in the land: toleration merged with prudence and self-interest ensured Guthrum was no longer a threat. Indeed, Machiavelli warned that killing an opponent’s family is likely to raise their ire but taking away their land is guaranteed to continue the fight over generations. It may be reasonably held that the aggressors deserve punishment of some sort, although Alfred’s example highlights an alternative view of dealing with an enemy, one that reminds the theorist that peace not further war remains the goal. But what if the defeated aggressors are guilty of atrocities, surely they should be made to stand trial to send a signal to other “war criminals” as well as to punish them for their own misdeeds? Here we enter the debates regarding punishment: does punishing a violator make any sense except to exact either retribution, revenge, or to promote a deterrence? Can the victors be sure of their claim to punish the aggressors and what good could possibly flow from bringing more violence or enslavement to the world? In asserting the need to find universalisable principles, the just war theorist is usually keen to insist that any war crimes trials are held in neutral states and presided over by neutral parties, rather than the victors whose partiality in proceedings must be presumed: after all, in the Nuremberg and Tokyo trials, no allied generals or politicians were held accountable for the atrocities created by bombing civilian centers in Germany and Japan and the dropping of nuclear bombs on Hiroshima and Nagasaki.

The end game and hence the jus post bellum certainly merit attention before the battles are lost or won: what should be the ruling affairs once the peace is proclaimed? Should the terms of war’s end be elaborated and publicly pronounced as to ensure all parties are aware of the costs of defeat? Is it right that an army should demand unconditional surrender, for instance, when such a policy may entail a protracted war for no incentive is given to the other side to surrender; on the other hand, unconditional surrender implies a derogatory view of the enemy as one not to be respected either in or after war. Yet if an unconditional surrender policy does suitably raise the stakes of fighting war it may act as a sufficient deterrent against possible aggressors or act as a useful diplomatic tool to bring a worried enemy back to peaceful overtures. Similarly, is it right that an army should demand reparations in advance rather than leave them undisclosed and thereby risk the uncertainty of punishment creating a backlash from the defeated, who may not wish to be so subjected? To keep the expected conditions of war’s end secretive does not seem a wise move in that uncertainty generates fear, and fear can generate a harder campaign than otherwise would be necessary; but if the publicized conditions appear onerous to the enemy, then they have good reasons to prolong and/or intensify their own fight. Of course, if promises of an amnesty or fair treatment of prisoners is reneged on by the victor, then all trust for future arrangements is lost and the consequences imply embedding hatreds and mistrust for generations.

Assume that victory is given, that the army has defeated its enemy on the battlefield so attention turns to the nature of the post bellum justice of dealing with the defeated regardless of its intentions beforehand. Arguably, the very nature of the warring participants’ vision of each other and of themselves will color the proceedings both politically and morally. A victorious side, for instance, that sees itself as rightfully triumphant is more likely to impose its will and exactions upon the defeated in a more stringent manner in which a victorious side that sees itself as its enemy’s equal; but universality demands seeing one’s enemy as oneself and understanding not just the Realpolitik of state interests and state gains in victory but also the conventions of magnanimity and honor in victory (or defeat).

Consider the demands for reparations. A defeated aggressor may just be asked to pay for the damage incurred by the war (as justice demands of criminals that they pay for their crimes). But to what extent should the reparations extend? Should there be demands for retribution and deterrence added in, so that those deemed responsible for their aggression should be put on trial and suitably punished (and what would “suitable” mean in this instance – that Saddam Hussein stand trial for his invasion of Kuwait implies that George W Bush similarly stand trial for his invasions of Afghanistan and Iraq?). In forming the conditions of defeat, should neutral third parties be turned to so as to avoid later accusations of “victor’s justice” and the partiality that such justice can invoke or imply, or does victory present the victor with the ultimate moral wreath to justify whatever demands seen appropriate or fitting?

Should a war be indecisive though, the character of the peace would presumably be formed by the character of the ceasefire – namely, the cessation of fighting would imply a mere hiatus in which the belligerents regain the time and resources to stock their defenses and prepare for further fighting. As such, a ceasefire would be merely a respite for the military to regain its strengths. However, just war theory also acts to remind contenders that war is a last resort and that its essential aim is always peace, so if peace is forthcoming in any guise, it is morally critical for all parties to seek a return to a permanent peace rather than a momentary lapse of war.

5. Conclusion

This article has described the main tenets of the just war theory, as well as some of the problems that it entails. The theory bridges theoretical and applied ethics, since it demands an adherence, or at least a consideration of meta-ethical conditions and models, as well as prompting concern for the practicalities of war. A few of those practicalities have been mentioned here. Other areas of interest are: hostages, innocent threats, international blockades, sieges, the use of weapons of mass destruction or of anti-personnel weapons (for example, land mines), and the morality and practicalities of interventionism.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Anscombe, Elizabeth. (1981) “War and Murder”. In Ethics, Religion, and Politics. University of Minnesota Press. pp. 51-71.
  • Aquinas, St Thomas. (1988). Politics and Ethics. Norton.
  • Augustine, St. (1984). City of God. Penguin.
  • Belfield, Richard (2005). Assassination: The Killers and their Paymasters Revealed. Magpie Books.
  • Burke, Edmund (1986). Reflections on the Revolution in France. Penguin.
  • Dockrill, Michael and Barrie Paskins (1979). The Ethics of War.
  • Hobbes, Thomas (1988). Leviathan. Penguin.
  • Jokic Alexsander, and Anthony Ellis eds. (2001), War Crimes and Collective Wrongdoing. WileyBlackwell.
  • Locke, John (1963). Two Treatises of Government. Cambridge University Press.
  • Machiavelli, Nicolo (1988). The Prince. Cambridge University Press.
  • Minear, Richard (1971). Victor’s Justice: The Tokyo War Crimes Trial. Princeton.
  • Moseley, Alexander and Richard Norman, eds. (2001) Human Rights and Military Intervention. Ashgate.
  • Moseley, Alexander (2006). An Introduction to Political Philosophy. Continuum.
  • Nagel, Thomas (1972). “War and Massacre.” Philosophy and Public Affairs . Vol. 1, pp. 123-44.
  • Norman, Richard (1995). Ethics, Killing, and War.
  • Orend, Brian (2001). War and International Justice. Wilfrid Laurier Press.
  • Orend, Brian (2006). The Morality of War. Broadview.
  • Robertson, Geoffrey (1999). Crimes Against Humanity.
  • Robinson, Paul ed., (2003) Just War in a Comparative Perspective. Ashgate.
  • Robinson, Paul. (2006). Military Honour and the Conduct of War. Routledge.
  • Thucydides (1974). History of the Peloponnesian War. Penguin.
  • Tolstoy, Leo (1992). War and Peace. Everyman.
  • Walzer, Michael (1978). Just and Unjust Wars. Basic Books.

Author Information

Alexander Moseley
United Kingdom


Punishment involves the deliberate infliction of suffering on a supposed or actual offender for an offense such as a moral or legal transgression. Since punishment involves inflicting a pain or deprivation similar to that which the perpetrator of a crime inflicts on his victim, it has generally been agreed that punishment requires moral as well as legal and political justification. While philosophers almost all agree that punishment is at least sometimes justifiable, they offer various accounts of how it is to be justified as well as what the infliction of punishment is designed to protect – rights, personal autonomy and private property, a political constitution, or the democratic process, for instance. Utilitarians attempt to justify punishment in terms of the balance of good over evil produced and thus focus our attention on extrinsic or consequentialist considerations. Retributivists attempt a justification that links punishment to moral wrongdoing, generally justifying the practice on the grounds that it gives to wrongdoers what they deserve; their focus is thus on the intrinsic wrongness of crime that thereby merits punishment. “Compromise” theorists attempt to combine these two types of theories in a way that retains their perceived strengths while overcoming their perceived weaknesses. After discussing the various attempts at justification, utilitarian and retributive approaches to determining the amount of punishment will be examined. Finally, the controversial issue of capital punishment will be briefly discussed.

Table of Contents

  1. Utilitarianism
    1. Utilitarian Justification
    2. Objection and Response
  2. Retributivism
    1. Retributive Justification
    2. Objection and Response
  3. Compromise Theories
    1. Hart’s Theory
    2. Objection and Response
  4. Amount of Punishment
    1. Utilitarians on Amount
    2. Retributivists on Amount
  5. Capital Punishment
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Utilitarianism

a. Utilitarian Justification

Utilitarianism is the moral theory that holds that the rightness or wrongness of an action is determined by the balance of good over evil that is produced by that action. Philosophers have argued over exactly how the resulting good and evil may be identified and to whom the greatest good should belong. Jeremy Bentham identified good with pleasure and evil with pain and held that the greatest pleasure should belong to the greatest number of people. John Stuart Mill, perhaps the most notable utilitarian, identified good with happiness and evil with unhappiness and also held that the greatest happiness should belong to the greatest number. This is how utilitarianism is most often discussed in the literature, so we will follow Mill in our discussion.

When attempting to determine whether a punishment is justifiable, utilitarians will attempt to anticipate the likely consequences of carrying out the punishment. If punishing an offender would most likely produce the greatest balance of happiness over unhappiness compared with the other available options (not taking any action, publicly denouncing the offender, etc.), then the punishment is justified. If another available option would produce a greater balance of happiness over unhappiness, then that option should be chosen and punishment is unjustified.

Clearly, crimes tend to produce unhappiness, so in seeking to promote a state of affairs in which the balance of happiness over unhappiness is maximized, a utilitarian will be highly concerned with reducing crime. Traditionally, utilitarians have focused on three ways in which punishment can reduce crime. First, the threat of punishment can deter potential offenders. If an individual is tempted to commit a certain crime, but he knows that it is against the law and a punishment is attached to a conviction for breaking that law, then, generally speaking, that potential offender will be less likely to commit the crime. Second, punishment can incapacitate offenders. If an offender is confined for a certain period of time, then that offender will be less able to harm others during that period of time. Third, punishment can rehabilitate offenders. Rehabilitation involves making strides to improve an offender’s character so that he will be less likely to re-offend.

Although utilitarians have traditionally focused on these three ways in which punishment can reduce crime, there are other ways in which a punishment can affect the balance of happiness over unhappiness. For example, whether or not a given offender is punished will affect how the society views the governmental institution that is charged with responding to violations of the law. The degree to which they believe this institution is functioning justly will clearly affect their happiness. Utilitarians are committed to taking into account every consequence of a given punishment insofar as it affects the balance of happiness over unhappiness.

b. Objection and Response

Perhaps the most common objection to the utilitarian justification of punishment is that its proponent is committed to punishing individuals in situations in which punishment would clearly be morally wrong. H.J. McCloskey offers the following example:

Suppose a utilitarian were visiting an area in which there was racial strife, and that, during his visit, a Negro rapes a white woman, and that race riots occur as a result of the crime, white mobs, with the connivance of the police, bashing and killing Negroes, etc. Suppose too that our utilitarian is in the area of the crime when it is committed such that his testimony would bring about the conviction of a particular Negro. If he knows that a quick arrest will stop the riots and lynchings, surely, as a utilitarian, he must conclude that he has a duty to bear false witness in order to bring about the punishment of an innocent person (127).

A utilitarian is committed to endorsing the act that would be most likely to produce the greatest balance of happiness over unhappiness, and, in this situation, it appears that the act that meets this criterion is bearing false witness against an innocent person. But, so the argument goes, it cannot be morally permissible, let alone morally mandatory, to perform an act that leads directly to the punishment of an innocent person. Therefore, since the utilitarian is committed to performing this clearly wrong act, the utilitarian justification must be incorrect.

The standard utilitarian response to this argument demands that we look more closely at the example. Once we do this, it supposedly becomes clear that the utilitarian is not committed to performing this clearly wrong act. In his reply to McCloskey’s argument, T.L.S. Sprigge states that if faced with the decision presented in the example, a “sensible utilitarian” will attach a great deal of weight to the near-certain fact that framing an innocent man would produce a great deal of misery for that man and his family. This consideration would receive such weight because “the prediction of misery… rests on well confirmed generalizations” (72). Furthermore, the sensible utilitarian will not attach much weight to the possibility that framing the man would stop the riots. This is because this prediction “will be based on a hunch about the character of the riots” (72). Since well confirmed generalizations are more reliable than hunches, happiness is most likely to be maximized when individuals give the vast majority of the weight to such well confirmed generalizations when making moral decisions. Therefore, since the relevant well confirmed generalization tells us that at least a few people (the innocent man and his family) would be made miserable by the false testimony, the utilitarian would give much weight to this consideration and choose not to bear false witness against an innocent man.

This type of response can in turn be challenged in various ways, but perhaps the best way to challenge it is to point out that even if it is true that the greatest balance of good over evil would not be promoted by punishing an innocent person in this situation, that is not the reason why punishing an innocent person would be wrong. It would be wrong because it would be unjust. The innocent man did not rape the woman, so he does not deserve to be punished for that crime. Because utilitarianism focuses solely on the balance of happiness over unhappiness that is produced by various actions, it is unable to take into account important factors such as justice and desert. If justice and desert cannot be incorporated into the theory, then the punishment of innocents cannot be ruled out as unjust, so a prohibition against it will have to be dependent upon the likelihood of various consequences. This strikes many theorists as problematic.

2. Retributivism

a. Retributive Justification

Regarding retributive theories, C.L. Ten states that, “There is no complete agreement about what sorts of theories are retributive except that all such theories try to establish an essential link between punishment and moral wrongdoing” (38). He is surely right about this, so, therefore, it is difficult to give a general account of retributive justification. However, it is possible to state certain features that characterize retributive theories generally. Concepts of desert and justice occupy a central place in most retributive theories: in accordance with the demands of justice, wrongdoers are thought to deserve to suffer, so punishment is justified on the grounds that it gives to wrongdoers what they deserve. It is instructive to look at the form that a particular retributive theory can take, so we will examine the views of Immanuel Kant.

Kant invokes what he refers to as the “principle of equality” in his discussion of punishment. If this principle is obeyed, then “the pointer of the scale of justice is made to incline no more to the one side than the other” (104). If a wrongful act is committed, then the person who has committed it has upset the balance of the scale of justice. He has inflicted suffering on another, and therefore rendered himself deserving of suffering. So in order to balance the scale of justice, it is necessary to inflict the deserved suffering on him. But it is not permissible to just inflict any type of suffering. Kant states that the act that the person has performed “is to be regarded as perpetrated on himself” (104). This he refers to as the “principle of retaliation”. Perhaps the most straightforward application of this principle demands that murderers receive the penalty of death. So, for Kant, the justification of punishment is derived from the principle of retaliation, which is grounded in the principle of equality.

The concepts of desert and justice play a central role in Kant’s theory, and they are applied in a way that rules out the possibility of justifying the punishment of innocents. Since an innocent person does not deserve to be punished, a Kantian is not committed to punishing an innocent person, and since it seems to some that utilitarians are committed to punishing innocents (or participating in the punishment of innocents) in certain circumstances, Kant’s theory may seem to be superior in this respect. Recall that the failure to take desert and justice into consideration is thought by many to be a major problem with utilitarian theory. However, while Kantian theory may seem superior because it takes desert and justice into account, an influential criticism of the theory challenges the idea that punishment can be justified on the grounds of justice and desert without requiring that the balance of happiness over unhappiness be taken into account.

b. Objection and Response

Gertrude Ezorsky argues that we should test the Kantian position and other retributive positions that resemble it “by imagining a world in which punishing criminals has no further effects worth achieving” (xviii). In this world, punishment does not deter or rehabilitate. For whatever reason, incapacitation is impossible. In addition, victims receive no satisfaction from the punishment of those who have harmed them. In this world, a Kantian would be committed to the position that punishments still ought to be inflicted upon wrongdoers. Furthermore, the individuals that populated this world would be morally obligated to punish wrongdoers. If they failed to punish wrongdoers, they would be failing to abide by the dictates of justice. But surely it is quite odd to hold that these individuals would be morally obligated to punish when doing so would not produce any positive effects for anyone. According to Ezorsky, this terribly odd consequence suggests that the Kantian theory is problematic.

Kant would not agree that this consequence of his theory is odd. According to Kant, “if justice and righteousness perish, human life would no longer have any value in the world” (104). So, even the inhabitants of our imaginary world are obliged to ensure that “every one may realize the desert of his deeds” (106). If they do not live up to this obligation, then they will be failing to abide by the dictates of justice, and their lives will be of lesser value. Of course, critics of the Kantian theory are unlikely to be persuaded by this response. Indeed, it is appropriate to be highly skeptical of a conception of justice that holds that justice can be promoted without anyone’s welfare being promoted.

As stated earlier, many of the theories that are referred to as “retributive” vary significantly from one another. However, as the Kantian theory possesses many central features that other retributive theories possess, criticisms similar to Ezorsky’s have been leveled against many of them. Predictably, the responses to these criticisms vary depending on the particular theory.

3. Compromise Theories

Many theorists have attempted to take features of utilitarianism and retributivism and combine them into a theory that retains the strengths of both while overcoming their weaknesses. The impetus for attempting to develop this sort of theory is clear: the idea that punishment should promote good consequences, such as the reduction of crime, surely seems attractive. However, the idea that it would be justified to punish an innocent in any circumstance where such punishment would be likely to promote the greatest balance of happiness over unhappiness surely seems wrong. Likewise, the idea that justice and the desert of the offender should play a central role in a justification of punishment is attractive, while being committed to punishing an offender even when nobody’s welfare would be promoted as a result seems to be problematic. So, each type of theory seems to have positive and negative aspects. But how to combine these seemingly opposed theories and produce a better one? Is a compromise between them really possible? In an attempt to explore this possibility, we will examine the theory of H.L.A. Hart.

a. Hart’s Theory

According to Hart, in order to clarify our thinking on the subject of punishment,

What is needed is the realization that different principles… are relevant at different points in any morally acceptable account of punishment. What we should look for are answers to a number of different questions such as: What justifies the general practice of punishment? To whom may punishment be applied? (3)

The failure to separate these questions from one another and consider that they might be answered by appealing to different principles has prevented many previous theorists from generating an acceptable account of punishment. Hart states that the first question (“What justifies the general practice of punishment?”) is a question of “General Justifying Aim” and ought to be answered by citing utilitarian concerns. The second (“To whom may punishment be applied?”) is a question of “Distribution” and ought to be answered by citing retributive concerns. So, the general practice is to be justified by citing the social consequences of punishment, the main social consequence being the reduction of crime, but we ought not be permitted to punish whenever inflicting a punishment is likely to reduce crime. In other words, we may not apply punishment indiscriminately. We may only punish “an offender for an offense” (9). With few exceptions, the individual upon whom punishment is inflicted must have committed an offense, and the punishment must be attached to that offense.

Hart’s theory attempts to avoid what may have appeared to be an impasse blocking the construction of an acceptable theory of punishment. Utilitarian concerns play a major role in his theory: the practice of punishment must promote the reduction of crime, or else it is not justifiable. But retributive concerns also play a major role: the range of acceptable practices that can be engaged in by those concerned with reducing crime is to be constrained by a retributive principle allowing only the punishment of an offender for an offense. Hart’s theory, at the very least, represents a plausible attempt at a “compromise” between those inclined towards utilitarianism and those inclined towards retributivism.

Hart does admit that on certain occasions the principle stating that we may only punish an offender for an offense (referred to as the principle of “retribution in Distribution”) may be overridden by utilitarian concerns. When the utilitarian case for punishing an innocent person is particularly compelling, it may be good for us to do so, but “we should do so with the sense of sacrificing an important principle” (12). Many people will agree with Hart that it may be necessary to punish an innocent person in extreme cases, and it is thought to be an advantage of his theory that it captures the sense that, in these cases, an important principle is being overridden.

b. Objection and Response

This overriding process, however, cannot work in the opposite direction. In Hart’s theory, some social good must be promoted or some social evil must be reduced in order for punishment to be justified. Because of this, it is unjustifiable to punish a person who seems to deserve punishment unless some utilitarian aim is being furthered. Imagine the most despicable character you can think of, a mass-murderer perhaps. The justifiability of punishing a person guilty of such crimes is beholden to the social consequences of the punishment. That a depraved character would suffer for his wrongdoing is not enough. So, for Hart, considerations of desert cannot override utilitarian considerations in this way. Some theorists find this consequence of his theory unacceptable. Ten argues that, “it would be unfair to punish an offender for a lesser offense and yet not punish another offender for a more serious offense” (80). If we are behaving in accordance with Hart’s theory, we may, on occasion, have to avoid punishing serious offenders while continuing to punish less serious offenders for utilitarian reasons. Since doing so would be unfair, it seems that Hart’s theory may be seriously flawed.

In order to assess Ten’s criticism, it is important to ask the following question: If we were to avoid punishing the more serious offender, to whom would we be being unfair? In an effort to answer this question, we must consider whether the offender who has committed the lesser crime has grounds for complaint if the more serious offender is not punished. By stipulation, the lesser offender committed the crime and cannot thereby claim a violation of justice on those grounds. Is the justification of his punishment contingent upon the punishment of others? Arguably not: The punishment of the lesser offender is justified regardless of whoever else is punished. He may bemoan his bad luck and wish that his punishment were not likely to further any utilitarian aims so that he may avoid it, but he cannot rightly accuse society of a violation of justice for failing to punish others when he does in fact deserve the punishment that is being inflicted upon him. The attractiveness of Ten’s argument is derived from the fact that its conclusion fits with our intuitions regarding the idea that some people just deserve to suffer no matter what. Perhaps we ought to reexamine that intuition and consider that it may be rooted in an urge to revenge, not a concern for justice.

4. Amount of Punishment

The belief that, in most cases, the amount of punishment should vary directly with the seriousness of the offense is widely accepted. However, utilitarians and retributivists have different ways of arriving at this general conclusion.

a. Utilitarians on Amount

Bentham, a utilitarian, states that, “The greater the mischief of the offence, the greater is the expense, which it may be worth while to be at, in the way of punishment” (181). Crime and punishment both tend to cause unhappiness. Recall that utilitarianism is solely concerned with the balance of happiness over unhappiness produced by an action. When attempting to determine the amount of punishment that ought to be permitted for a given offense, it is necessary to weigh the unhappiness that would be caused by the offense against the unhappiness caused by various punishments. The greater the unhappiness caused by a given offense, the greater the amount of punishment that may be inflicted for that offense in order to reduce its occurrence before the unhappiness caused by the punishment outweighs the unhappiness caused by the offense (Ten, 143).

So, utilitarians would often be committed to abiding by the rule that the amount of punishment should vary directly with the seriousness of the offense. However, it seems that there are cases in which they would be committed to violating this rule. Critics argue that utilitarians would sometimes be committed to inflicting a severe punishment for a relatively minor offense. Ten asks us to imagine a society in which there are many petty thefts and thieves are very difficult to catch. Since there are many thefts, the total amount of unhappiness caused by them is great. Imagine that one thief is caught and the authorities are deciding how severely to punish him. If these authorities were utilitarians, they would be committed to giving him a very severe sentence, 10 years perhaps, if this were the only way to deter a significant number of petty thieves. But surely making an example of the one thief who was unlucky or unskilled enough to be caught is unjust. Since utilitarians are sometimes committed to inflicting such harsh punishments for relatively minor offenses, their approach must be inadequate (143-144).

b. Retributivists on Amount

Retributivists argue that more serious offenses should be punished more severely because offenders who commit more serious crimes deserve harsher punishment than those who commit less serious crimes. Given our previous discussion of retributivism, it should not come as a surprise that the concept of desert plays a central role here. According to many classic versions of retributivism, including Kant’s, the deserved punishment is determined by invoking the lex talionis. The old adage, “An eye for an eye, a tooth for a tooth,” is derived from the lex talionis, which “requires imposing a harm on a criminal identical to the one he imposed on his victim” (Shafer-Landau, 773). Those who argue that murderers ought to be put to death have often invoked this principle, but it is rarely invoked when attempting to determine the proper punishment for other crimes. Its lack of popularity can be explained by noting a couple of objections. First, it is difficult to apply to many offenses, and it seems to be outright inapplicable to some. How should we punish the counterfeiter, the hijacker, or the childless kidnapper? Applying the lex talionis to these crimes is, at the very least, problematic. Second, there are many cases in which it would require that we punish offenders by performing actions that ought not to be carried out by any government (773). Surely we should not rape rapists! For these and other reasons, except when the topic at hand is capital punishment, appeals to the lex talionis in the contemporary literature are rare.

Many contemporary retributivists hold that the principle of proportionality should be used in order to determine the amount of punishment to be meted out in particular cases. This principle states that, “the amount of punishment should be proportionate to the moral seriousness or moral gravity of offenses…” (Ten, 154). Different versions of the proportionality principle call for different ways of establishing how severe a punishment must be in order to meet the demands set by the principle. Must it merely be the case that there be a direct relationship between the amount of punishment and the seriousness of the offense, or must offenders suffer the same amount as their victim(s) in order for the demands of the principle to be met? Retributivists are not in complete agreement on how to answer this question.

While retributivists seem to have an easier time ensuring that there be a direct relationship between the amount of punishment and the seriousness of the offense, their position is subject to criticism. Because they are committed to inflicting the deserved punishment, they must do so even when a lesser punishment would produce the same social effects. Clearly, this criticism runs parallel to the objection to retributivism discussed in section 2: if the retributivist is committed to inflicting the deserved punishment regardless of the social effects, then it seems that he is committed to inflicting gratuitous pain on an offender. Of course, some resist the idea that inflicting suffering in such a case would be gratuitous, which is why this debate continues. In any case, the perceived shortcomings of both the utilitarian and retributive approaches have led theorists to attempt to develop approaches that combine elements of both. For reasons similar to those cited in support of the aforementioned “compromise” theories, it seems that these approaches are the most promising.

5. Capital Punishment

Capital punishment involves the deliberate killing of a supposed or actual offender for an offense. Throughout history and across different societies, criminals have been executed for a variety of offenses, but much of the literature is devoted to examining whether those convicted of murder ought to be executed, and this discussion will be similarly focused.

A combination of utilitarian and retributive considerations are usually invoked in an effort to justify the execution of murderers. The centerpiece of most arguments in favor of capital punishment is retributive: Murderers deserve to be put to death. This is usually argued for along Kantian lines: By deliberately causing an innocent person’s death, the murderer has rendered himself deserving of death. Utilitarian considerations generally play a large role as well. Proponents argue that the threat of capital punishment can deter potential murderers. Since many human beings’ greatest fear is death, the intuitive plausibility of this claim is clear. In addition, proponents point to the fact that capital punishment is the ultimate incapacitation. Clearly, if a murderer is dead, then he can never harm anyone again.

Opponents of capital punishment challenge proponents on each of these points. Albert Camus denies that murder and capital punishment are equivalent to one another:

But what is capital punishment if not the most premeditated of murders, to which no criminal act, no matter how calculated, can be compared? If there were to be a real equivalence, the death penalty would have to be pronounced upon a criminal who had forewarned his victim of the very moment he would put him to a horrible death, and who, from that time on, had kept him confined at his own discretion for a period of months. It is not in private life that one meets such monsters (25).

This argument and others that resemble it are often put forth in an attempt to counter the retributive argument. Also, any criminal justice system that executes convicted criminals runs the risk of executing some individuals who do not deserve to be executed: the wrongfully convicted. Some argue that a fallible criminal justice system ought not to impose a penalty that removes the possibility of mistakes being rectified. The utilitarian arguments have also come under attack. Some argue that the proponents of capital punishment have overstated its deterrent value, and it has been argued that it may even incite some people to commit murder (Bedau, 198-200). Regarding incapacitation, it has been argued that the danger involved in failing to execute murderers has been similarly overstated (196-198).

6. Conclusion

These issues introducing punishment have received a great deal of attention in the professional literature, and many philosophers continue to discuss them and offer various answers to the questions that are raised. However, the issues raised here are not the only ones. There are many, including the role of excuses and mitigating circumstances, the usage of insanity as a defense, the imprisonment of offenders, and the cultural and historical context of punishment.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Beccaria, Cesare. On Crimes and Punishments. Trans. David Young. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1986.
  • Bedau, Hugo Adam. “Capital Punishment.” In Matters of Life and Death: New Introductory Essays in Moral Philosophy. Ed. Tom Regan. New York: Random House, 1986. 175-212.
  • Bedau, Hugo Adam, and Paul Cassell, eds. Debating the Death Penalty: Should America Have Capital Punishment? The Experts on Both Sides Make Their Best Case. New York: Oxford University Press, 2004.
  • Bentham, Jeremy. The Principles of Morals and Legislation. New York: Hafner Publishing Company, 1948.
  • Camus, Albert. Reflections on the Guillotine. Trans. Richard Howard. Michigan City, IN: Fridtjof-Karla Publications, 1959.
  • Duff, R.A. “Penal Communications: Recent Work in the Philosophy of Punishment.” Crime and Justice 20 (1996): 1-97.
  • Duff, R.A., and David Garland, eds. A Reader on Punishment. New York: Oxford University Press, 1994.
  • Ezorsky, Gertrude. “The Ethics of Punishment.” In Philosophical Perspectives on Punishment. Ed. Gertrude Ezorsky. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1972. xi-xxvii.
  • Foucault, Michel. Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison. Trans. Alan Sheridan. New York: Random House, 1977.
  • Hart, H.L.A. “Prolegomenon to the Principles of Punishment.” In Punishment and Responsibility: Essays in the Philosophy of Law. New York: Oxford University Press, 1968. 1-27.
  • Kant, Immanuel. “Justice and Punishment.” Trans. W. Hastie. In Philosophical Perspectives on Punishment. Ed. Gertrude Ezorsky. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1972. 102-106.
  • McCloskey, H.J. “A Non-Utilitarian Approach to Punishment.” In Philosophical Perspectives on Punishment. Ed. Gertrude Ezorsky. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1972. 119-134.
  • Mill, John Stuart. Utilitarianism. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1979. Shafer-Landau, Russ. “The Failure of Retributivism.” In Philosophy of Law. Ed. Joel Feinberg and Jules Coleman. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth/Thompson Learning, 2000. 769-779.
  • Sprigge, T.L.S. “A Utilitarian Reply to Dr. McCloskey.” In Philosophical Perspectives on Punishment. Ed. Gertrude Ezorsky. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1972. 66-79.
  • Ten, C.L. Crime, Guilt, and Punishment. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1987.

Author Information

Kevin Murtagh
John Jay College of Criminal Justice
U. S. A.

Human Rights

Human rights are certain moral guarantees. This article examines the philosophical basis and content of the doctrine of human rights. The analysis consists of five sections and a conclusion. Section one assesses the contemporary significance of human rights, and argues that the doctrine of human rights has become the dominant moral doctrine for evaluating the moral status of the contemporary geo-political order. Section two proceeds to chart the historical development of the concept of human rights, beginning with a discussion of the earliest philosophical origins of the philosophical bases of human rights and culminating in some of most recent developments in the codification of human rights. Section three considers the philosophical concept of a human right and analyses the formal and substantive distinctions philosophers have drawn between various forms and categories of rights. Section four addresses the question of how philosophers have sought to justify the claims of human rights and specifically charts the arguments presented by the two presently dominant approaches in this field: interest theory and will theory. Section five then proceeds to discuss some of the main criticisms currently levelled at the doctrine of human rights and highlights some of the main arguments of those who have challenged the universalist and objectivist bases of human rights. Finally, a brief conclusion is presented, summarising the main themes addressed.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction: the contemporary significance of human rights
  2. Historical origins and development of the theory and practice of human rights
  3. Philosophical analysis of the concept of human rights
    1. Moral vs. Legal Rights
    2. Claim Rights & Liberty Rights
    3. Substantive categories of human rights
    4. Scope of human rights duties
  4. Philosophical justifications of human rights
    1. Do human rights require philosophical justification?
    2. The interests theory approach
    3. The Will Theory Approach
  5. Philosophical criticisms of human rights
    1. Moral relativism
    2. Epistemological criticisms of human rights
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction: the contemporary significance of human rights

Human rights have been defined as

basic moral guarantees that people in all countries and cultures allegedly have simply because they are people. Calling these guarantees "rights" suggests that they attach to particular individuals who can invoke them, that they are of high priority, and that compliance with them is mandatory rather than discretionary. Human rights are frequently held to be universal in the sense that all people have and should enjoy them, and to be independent in the sense that they exist and are available as standards of justification and criticism whether or not they are recognized and implemented by the legal system or officials of a country. (Nickel, 1992:561-2)

The moral doctrine of human rights aims at identifying the fundamental prerequisites for each human being leading a minimally good life. Human rights aim to identify both the necessary negative and positive prerequisites for leading a minimally good life, such as rights against torture and rights to health care. This aspiration has been enshrined in various declarations and legal conventions issued during the past fifty years, initiated by the Universal Declaration of Human Rights (1948) and perpetuated by, most importantly, the European Convention on Human Rights (1954) and the International Covenant on Civil and Economic Rights (1966). Together these three documents form the centrepiece of a moral doctrine that many consider to be capable of providing the contemporary geo-political order with what amounts to an international bill of rights. However, the doctrine of human rights does not aim to be a fully comprehensive moral doctrine. An appeal to human rights does not provide us with a fully comprehensive account of morality per se. Human rights do not, for example, provide us with criteria for answering such questions as whether telling lies is inherently immoral, or what the extent of one's moral obligations to friends and lovers ought to be? What human rights do primarily aim to identify is the basis for determining the shape, content, and scope of fundamental, public moral norms. As James Nickel states, human rights aim to secure for individuals the necessary conditions for leading a minimally good life. Public authorities, both national and international, are identified as typically best placed to secure these conditions and so, the doctrine of human rights has become, for many, a first port of moral call for determining the basic moral guarantees all of us have a right to expect, both of one another but also, primarily, of those national and international institutions capable of directly affecting our most important interests. The doctrine of human rights aspires to provide the contemporary, allegedly post-ideological, geo-political order with a common framework for determining the basic economic, political, and social conditions required for all individuals to lead a minimally good life. While the practical efficacy of promoting and protecting human rights is significantly aided by individual nation-states' legally recognising the doctrine, the ultimate validity of human rights is characteristically thought of as not conditional upon such recognition. The moral justification of human rights is thought to precede considerations of strict national sovereignty. An underlying aspiration of the doctrine of human rights is to provide a set of legitimate criteria to which all nation-states should adhere. Appeals to national sovereignty should not provide a legitimate means for nation-states to permanently opt out of their fundamental human rights-based commitments. Thus, the doctrine of human rights is ideally placed to provide individuals with a powerful means for morally auditing the legitimacy of those contemporary national and international forms of political and economic authority which confront us and which claim jurisdiction over us. This is no small measure of the contemporary moral and political significance of the doctrine of human rights. For many of its most strident supporters, the doctrine of human rights aims to provide a fundamentally legitimate moral basis for regulating the contemporary geo-political order.

2. Historical origins and development of the theory and practice of human rights

The doctrine of human rights rests upon a particularly fundamental philosophical claim: that there exists a rationally identifiable moral order, an order whose legitimacy precedes contingent social and historical conditions and applies to all human beings everywhere and at all times. On this view, moral beliefs and concepts are capable of being objectively validated as fundamentally and universally true. The contemporary doctrine of human rights is one of a number of universalist moral perspectives. The origins and development of the theory of human rights is inextricably tied to the development of moral universalism. The history of the philosophical development of human rights is punctuated by a number of specific moral doctrines which, though not themselves full and adequate expressions of human rights, have nevertheless provided a number of philosophical prerequisites for the contemporary doctrine. These include a view of morality and justice as emanating from some pre-social domain, the identification of which provides the basis for distinguishing between 'true' and merely ‘conventional’ moral principles and beliefs. The essential prerequisites for a defence of human rights also include a conception of the individual as the bearer of certain 'natural' rights and a particular view of the inherent and equal moral worth of each rational individual. I shall discuss each in turn.

Human rights rest upon moral universalism and the belief in the existence of a truly universal moral community comprising all human beings. Moral universalism posits the existence of rationally identifiable trans-cultural and trans-historical moral truths. The origins of moral universalism within Europe are typically associated with the writings of Aristotle and the Stoics. Thus, in his Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle unambiguously expounds an argument in support of the existence of a natural moral order. This natural order ought to provide the basis for all truly rational systems of justice. An appeal to the natural order provides a set of comprehensive and potentially universal criteria for evaluating the legitimacy of actual 'man-made' legal systems. In distinguishing between ‘natural justice' and 'legal justice’, Aristotle writes, ‘the natural is that which has the same validity everywhere and does not depend upon acceptance.' (Nicomachean Ethics, 189) Thus, the criteria for determining a truly rational system of justice pre-exist social and historical conventions. 'Natural justice' pre-exists specific social and political configurations. The means for determining the form and content of natural justice is the exercise of reason free from the distorting effects of mere prejudice or desire. This basic idea was similarly expressed by the Roman Stoics, such as Cicero and Seneca, who argued that morality originated in the rational will of God and the existence of a cosmic city from which one could discern a natural, moral law whose authority transcended all local legal codes. The Stoics' argued that this ethically universal code imposed upon all of us a duty to obey the will of god. The Stoics thereby posited the existence of a universal moral community effected through our shared relationship with god. The belief in the existence of a universal moral community was maintained in Europe by Christianity over the ensuing centuries. While some have discerned intimations towards the notion of rights in the writings of Aristotle, the Stoics, and Christian theologians, a concept of rights approximating that of the contemporary idea of human rights most clearly emerges during the 17th. And 18th. Centuries in Europe and the so-called doctrine of natural law.

The basis of the doctrine of natural law is the belief in the existence of a natural moral code based upon the identification of certain fundamental and objectively verifiable human goods. Our enjoyment of these basic goods is to be secured by our possession of equally fundamental and objectively verifiable natural rights. Natural law was deemed to pre-exist actual social and political systems. Natural rights were thereby similarly presented as rights individuals possessed independently of society or polity. Natural rights were thereby presented as ultimately valid irrespective of whether they had achieved the recognition of any given political ruler or assembly. The quintessential exponent of this position was the 17th. Century philosopher John Locke and, in particular, the argument he outlined in his Two Treatises of Government (1688). At the centre of Locke's argument is the claim that individuals possess natural rights, independently of the political recognition granted them by the state. These natural rights are possessed independently of, and prior to, the formation of any political community. Locke argued that natural rights flowed from natural law. Natural law originated from God. Accurately discerning the will of God provided us with an ultimately authoritative moral code. At root, each of us owes a duty of self-preservation to God. In order to successfully discharge this duty of self-preservation each individual had to be free from threats to life and liberty, whilst also requiring what Locke presented as the basic, positive means for self-preservation: personal property. Our duty of self-preservation to god entailed the necessary existence of basic natural rights to life, liberty, and property. Locke proceeded to argue that the principal purpose of the investiture of political authority in a sovereign state was the provision and protection of individuals' basic natural rights. For Locke, the protection and promotion of individuals’ natural rights was the sole justification for the creation of government. The natural rights to life, liberty, and property set clear limits to the authority and jurisdiction of the State. States were presented as existing to serve the interests, the natural rights, of the people, and not of a Monarch or a ruling cadre. Locke went so far as to argue that individuals are morally justified in taking up arms against their government should it systematically and deliberately fail in its duty to secure individuals' possession of natural rights.

Analyses of the historical predecessors of the contemporary theory of human rights typically accord a high degree of importance to Locke's contribution. Certainly, Locke provided the precedent of establishing legitimate political authority upon a rights foundation. This is an undeniably essential component of human rights. However, the philosophically adequate completion of theoretical basis of human rights requires an account of moral reasoning, that is both consistent with the concept of rights, but which does not necessarily require an appeal to the authority of some super-human entity in justifying human beings' claims to certain, fundamental rights. The 18th. Century German philosopher, Immanuel Kant provides such an account.

Many of the central themes first expressed within Kant's moral philosophy remain highly prominent in contemporary philosophical justifications of human rights. Foremost amongst these are the ideals of equality and the moral autonomy of rational human beings. Kant bestows upon contemporary human rights' theory the ideal of a potentially universal community of rational individuals autonomously determining the moral principles for securing the conditions for equality and autonomy. Kant provides a means for justifying human rights as the basis for self-determination grounded within the authority of human reason. Kant's moral philosophy is based upon an appeal to the formal principles of ethics, rather than, for example, an appeal to a concept of substantive human goods. For Kant, the determination of any such goods can only proceed from a correct determination of the formal properties of human reason and thus do not provide the ultimate means for determining the correct ends, or object, of human reason. Kant's moral philosophy begins with an attempt to correctly identify those principles of reasoning that can be applied equally to all rational persons, irrespective of their own specific desires or partial interests. In this way, Kant attaches a condition of universality to the correct identification of moral principles. For him, the basis of moral reasoning must rest upon a condition that all rational individuals are bound to assent to. Doing the right thing is thus not determined by acting in pursuit of one's own interests or desires, but acting in accordance with a maxim which all rational individuals are bound to accept. Kant terms this the categorical imperative, which he formulates in the following terms, 'act only on that maxim through which you can at the same time will that it should become a universal law.' (1948:84). Kant argues that this basic condition of universality in determining the moral principles for governing human relations is a necessary expression of the moral autonomy and fundamental equality of all rational individuals. The categorical imperative is self-imposed by morally autonomous and formally equal rational persons. It provides the basis for determining the scope and form of those laws which morally autonomous and equally rational individuals will institute in order to secure these very same conditions. For Kant, the capacity for the exercise of reason is the distinguishing characteristic of humanity and the basis for justifying human dignity. As the distinguishing characteristic of humanity, formulating the principles of the exercise of reason must necessarily satisfy a test of universality; they must be capable of being universally recognized by all equally rational agents. Hence, Kant's formulation of the categorical imperative. Kant’s moral philosophy is notoriously abstract and resists easy comprehension. Though often overlooked in accounts of the historical development of human rights, his contribution to human rights has been profound. Kant provides a formulation of fundamental moral principles that, though exceedingly formal and abstract, are based upon the twin ideals of equality and moral autonomy. Human rights are rights we give to ourselves, so to speak, as autonomous and formally equal beings. For Kant, any such rights originate in the formal properties of human reason, and not the will of some super-human being.

The philosophical ideas defended by the likes of Locke and Kant have come to be associated with the general Enlightenment project initiated during the 17th. and 18th. Centuries, the effects of which were to extend across the globe and over ensuing centuries. Ideals such as natural rights, moral autonomy, human dignity and equality provided a normative bedrock for attempts at re-constituting political systems, for overthrowing formerly despotic regimes and seeking to replace them with forms of political authority capable of protecting and promoting these new emancipatory ideals. These ideals effected significant, even revolutionary, political upheavals throughout the 18th. Century, enshrined in such documents as the United States' Declaration of Independence and the French National Assembly’s Declaration of the Rights of Man and Citizen. Similarly, the concept of individual rights continued to resound throughout the 19th. Century exemplified by Mary Wollstencraft's Vindication of the Rights of Women and other political movements to extend political suffrage to sections of society who had been denied the possession of political and civil rights. The concept of rights had become a vehicle for effecting political change. Though one could argue that the conceptual prerequisites for the defence of human rights had long been in place, a full Declaration of the doctrine of human rights only finally occurred during the 20th. Century and only in response to the most atrocious violations of human rights, exemplified by the Holocaust. The Universal Declaration of Human Rights (UDHR) was adopted by the UN General Assembly on 10th. December 1948 and was explicitly motivated to prevent the future occurrence of any similar atrocities. The Declaration itself goes far beyond any mere attempt to reassert all individuals' possession of the right to life as a fundamental and inalienable human right. The UDHR consists of a Preamble and 30 articles which separately identify such things as the right not to be tortured (article 5), a right to asylum (article 14), a right to own property (article 17), and a right to an adequate standard of living (article 25) as being fundamental human rights. As I noted earlier, the UDHR has been further supplemented by such documents as the European Convention for the Protection of Human Rights and Fundamental Freedoms (1953) and the International Covenant on Economic, Social and Cultural Rights (1966). The specific aspirations contained within these three documents have themselves been reinforced by innumerable other Declarations and Conventions. Taken together these various Declarations, conventions and covenants comprise the contemporary human rights doctrine and embody both the belief in the existence of a universally valid moral order and a belief in all human beings' possession of fundamental and equal moral status, enshrined within the concept of human rights. It is important to note, however, that the contemporary doctrine of human rights, whilst deeply indebted to the concept of natural rights, is not a mere expression of that concept but actually goes beyond it in some highly significant respects. James Nickel ( 1987: 8-10) identifies three specific ways in which the contemporary concept of human rights differs from, and goes beyond that of natural rights. First, he argues that contemporary human rights are far more concerned to view the realization of equality as requiring positive action by the state, via the provision of welfare assistance, for example. Advocates of natural rights, he argues, were far more inclined to view equality in formalistic terms, as principally requiring the state to refrain from 'interfering' in individuals’ lives. Second, he argues that, whereas advocates of natural rights tended to conceive of human beings as mere individuals, veritable 'islands unto themselves', advocates of contemporary human rights are far more willing to recognize the importance of family and community in individuals' lives. Third, Nickel views contemporary human rights as being far more 'internationalist' in scope and orientation than was typically found within arguments in support of natural rights. That is to say, the protection and promotion of human rights are increasingly seen as requiring international action and concern. The distinction drawn by Nickel between contemporary human rights and natural rights allows one to discern the development of the concept of human rights. Indeed, many writers on human rights agree in the identification of three generations of human rights. First generation rights consist primarily of rights to security, property, and political participation. These are most typically associated with the French and US Declarations. Second generation rights are construed as socio-economic rights, rights to welfare, education, and leisure, for example. These rights largely originate within the UDHR. The final and third generation of rights are associated with such rights as a right to national self-determination, a clean environment, and the rights of indigenous minorities. This generation of rights really only takes hold during the last two decades of the 20th. Century but represents a significant development within the doctrine of human rights generally.

While the full significance of human rights may only be finally dawning on some people, the concept itself has a history spanning over two thousand years. The development of the concept of human rights is punctuated by the emergence and assimilation of various philosophical and moral ideals and appears to culminate, at least to our eyes, in the establishment of a highly complex set of legal and political documents and institutions, whose express purpose is the protection and promotion of the fundamental rights of all human beings everywhere. Few should underestimate the importance of this particular current of human history.

3. Philosophical analysis of the concept of human rights

Human rights are rights that attach to human beings and function as moral guarantees in support of our claims towards the enjoyment of a minimally good life. In conceptual terms, human rights are themselves derivative of the concept of a right. This section focuses upon the philosophical analysis of the concept of a 'right' in order to clearly demonstrate the various constituent parts of the concept from which human rights emerges. In order to gain a full understanding of both the philosophical foundations of the doctrine of human rights and the different ways in which separate human rights function, a detailed analysis is required.

a. Moral vs. Legal Rights

The distinction drawn between moral rights and legal rights as two separate categories of rights is of fundamental importance to understanding the basis and potential application of human rights. Legal rights refer to all those rights found within existing legal codes. A legal right is a right that enjoys the recognition and protection of the law. Questions as to its existence can be resolved by simply locating the relevant legal instrument or piece of legislation. A legal right cannot be said to exist prior to its passing into law and the limits of its validity are set by the jurisdiction of the body which passed the relevant legislation. An example of a legal right would be my daughter's legal right to receive an adequate education, as enshrined within the United Kingdom's Education Act (1944). Suffice it to say, that the exercise of this right is limited to the United Kingdom. My daughter has no legal right to receive an adequate education from a school board in Southern California. Legal positivists argue that the only rights that can be said to legitimately exist are legal rights, rights that originate within a legal system. On this view, moral rights are not rights in the strict sense, but are better thought of as moral claims, which may or may not eventually be assimilated within national or international law. For a legal positivist, such as the 19th. Century legal philosopher Jeremy Bentham, there can be no such thing as human rights existing prior to, or independently from legal codification. For a positivist determining the existence of rights is no more complicated than locating the relevant legal statute or precedent. In stark contrast, moral rights are rights that, it is claimed, exist prior to and independently from their legal counterparts. The existence and validity of a moral right is not deemed to be dependent upon the actions of jurists and legislators. Many people argued, for example, that the black majority in apartheid South Africa possessed a moral right to full political participation in that country's political system, even though there existed no such legal right. What is interesting is that many people framed their opposition to apartheid in rights terms. What many found so morally repugnant about apartheid South Africa was precisely its denial of numerous fundamental moral rights, including the rights not to be discriminated against on grounds of colour and rights to political participation, to the majority of that country's inhabitants. This particular line of opposition and protest could only be pursued because of a belief in the existence and validity of moral rights. A belief that fundamental rights which may or may not have received legal recognition elsewhere, remained utterly valid and morally compelling even, and perhaps especially, in those countries whose legal systems had not recognized these rights. A rights-based opposition to apartheid South Africa could not have been initiated and maintained by appeal to legal rights, for obvious reasons. No one could legitimately argue that the legal political rights of non-white South Africans were being violated under apartheid, since no such legal rights existed. The systematic denial of such rights did, however, constitute a gross violation of those peoples' fundamental moral rights.

From the above example it should be clear that human rights cannot be reduced to, or exclusively identified with legal rights. The legal positivist's account of justified law excludes the possibility of condemning such systems as apartheid from a rights perspective. It might, therefore, appear tempting to draw the conclusion that human rights are best identified as moral rights. After all, the existence of the UDHR and various International Covenants, to which South Africa was not a signatory in most cases, provided opponents of apartheid with a powerful moral argument. Apartheid was founded upon the denial of fundamental human rights. Human rights certainly share an essential quality of moral rights, namely, that their valid existence is not deemed to be conditional upon their being legally recognized. Human rights are meant to apply to all human beings everywhere, regardless of whether they have received legal recognition by all countries everywhere. Clearly, there remain numerous countries that wholly or partially exclude formal legal recognition to fundamental human rights. Supporters of human rights in these countries insist that the rights remain valid regardless, as fundamental moral rights. The universality of human rights positively entails such claims. The universality of human rights as moral rights clearly lends greater moral force to human rights. However, for their part, legal rights are not subject to disputes as to their existence and validity in quite the way moral rights are. It would be a mistake to exclusively identify human rights with moral rights. Human rights are better thought of as both moral rights and legal rights. Human rights originate as moral rights and their legitimacy is necessarily dependent upon the legitimacy of the concept of moral rights. A principal aim of advocates of human rights is for these rights to receive universal legal recognition. This was, after all, a fundamental goal of the opponents of apartheid. Human rights are best thought of, therefore, as being both moral and legal rights. The legitimacy claims of human rights are tied to their status as moral rights. The practical efficacy of human rights is, however, largely dependent upon their developing into legal rights. In those cases where specific human rights do not enjoy legal recognition, such as in the example of apartheid above, moral rights must be prioritised with the intention that defending the moral claims of such rights as a necessary prerequisite for the eventual legal recognition of the rights in question.

b. Claim Rights & Liberty Rights

To gain an understanding of the functional properties of human rights it is necessary to consider the more specific distinction drawn between claim rights and liberty rights. It should be noted that it is something of a convention to begin such discussions by reference to W.N. Hohfeld's (1919) more extended classification of rights. Hohfeld identified four categories of rights: liberty rights, claim rights, power rights, and immunity rights. However, numerous scholars have subsequently tended to collapse the last two within the first two and hence to restrict attention to liberty rights and claim rights. The political philosopher Peter Jones (1994) provides one such example.

Jones restricts his focus to the distinction between claim rights and liberty rights. He conforms to a well-established trend in rights' analysis in viewing the former as being of primary importance. Jones defines a claim right as consisting of being owed a duty. A claim right is a right one holds against another person or persons who owe a corresponding duty to the right holder. To return to the example of my daughter. Her right to receive an adequate education is a claim right held against the local education authority, which has a corresponding duty to provide her with the object of the right. Jones identifies further necessary distinctions within the concept of a claim right when he distinguishes between a positive claim right and a negative claim right. The former are rights one holds to some specific good or service, which some other has a duty to provide. My daughter's claim right to education is therefore a positive claim right. Negative claim rights, in contrast, are rights one holds against others' interfering in or trespassing upon one's life or property in some way. My daughter could be said to possess a negative claim right against others attempting to steal her mobile phone, for example. Indeed, such examples lead on to the final distinction Jones identifies within the concept of claim rights: rights held 'in personam' and rights held ‘in rem’. Rights held in personam are rights one holds against some specifically identified duty holder, such as the education authority. In contrast, rights held in rem are rights held against no one in particular, but apply to everyone. Thus, my daughter's right to an education would be practically useless were it not held against some identifiable, relevant, and competent body. Equally, her right against her mobile phone being stolen from her would be highly limited if it did not apply to all those capable of potentially performing such an act. Claim rights, then, can be of either a positive or a negative character and they can be held either in personam or in rem.

Jones defines liberty rights as rights which exist in the absence of any duties not to perform some desired activity and thus consist of those actions one is not prohibited from performing. In contrast to claim rights, liberty rights are primarily negative in character. For example, I may be said to possess a liberty right to spend my vacations lying on a particularly beautiful beach in Greece. Unfortunately, no one has a duty to positively provide for this particular exercise of my liberty right. There is no authority or body, equivalent to an education authority, for example, who has a responsibility to realize my dream for me. A liberty right can be said, then, to be a right to do as one pleases precisely because one is not under an obligation, grounded in others' claim rights, to refrain from so acting. Liberty rights provide for the capacity to be free, without actually providing the specific means by which one may pursue the objects of one's will. For example, a multi-millionaire and a penniless vagrant both possess an equal liberty right to holiday in the Caribbean each year.

c. Substantive categories of human rights

The above section was concerned to analyse what might be termed the 'formal properties' of rights. This section, in contrast, proceeds to consider the different categories of substantive human rights. If one delves into all of the various documents that together form the codified body of human rights, one can identify and distinguish between five different categories of substantive human rights. These are as follows: rights to life; rights to freedom; rights to political participation; rights to the protection of the rule of law; rights to fundamental social, economic, and cultural goods. These rights span the so-called three generations of rights and involve a complex combination of both liberty and claim rights. Some rights, such as for example the right to life, consist of both liberty and claim rights in roughly equal measure. Thus, the adequate protection of the right to life requires the existence of liberty rights against others trespassing against one's person and the existence of claim rights to have access to basic prerequisites to sustaining one's life, such as an adequate diet and health-care. Other rights, such as social, economic, and cultural rights, for example, are weighted more heavily towards the existence of various claim rights, which requires the positive provision of the objects of such rights. The making of substantive distinctions between human rights can have controversial, but important, consequences. Human rights are typically understood to be of equal value, each right is conceived of as equally important as every other. On this view, there can exist no potential for conflict between fundamental human rights. One is simply meant to attach equal moral weight to each and every human right. This prohibits arranging human rights in order of importance. However, conflict between rights can and does occur. Treating all human rights as of equal importance prohibits any attempts to address or resolve such conflict when it arises. Take the example of a hypothetical developing world country with severely limited financial and material resources. This country is incapable of providing the resources for realising all of the human rights for all of its citizens, though it is committed to doing so. In the meantime, government officials wish to know which human rights are more absolute than others, which fundamental human rights should it immediately prioritise and seek to provide for? This question, of course, cannot be answered if one sticks to the position that all rights are of equal importance. It can only be addressed if one allows for the possibility that some human rights are more fundamental than others and that the morally correct action for the government to take would be to prioritise these rights. A refusal to do so, no matter how consistent it may be philosophically would be tantamount to dogmatically sticking one's head in the metaphorical sands. Attempting to make such distinctions is, of course, a philosophically fraught exercise. It clearly requires the existence of some more ultimate criteria against which one can 'measure' the relative importance of separate human rights. This is a highly controversial issue within the philosophy of human rights and one which I shall return to when I consider how philosophers attempt to justify the doctrine of human rights. What remains to be addressed in our analysis of the concept of a human right are the questions of what adequately implementing human rights generally requires, and upon whom does this task fall; who has responsibility for protecting and promoting human rights and what is required of them to do so?

d. Scope of human rights duties

Human rights are said to be possessed equally, by everyone. A conventional corollary of this claim is that everyone has a duty to protect and promote the human rights of everyone else. However, in practice, the onus for securing human rights typically falls upon national governments and international, inter-governmental bodies. Philosophers such as Thomas Pogge (1995) argue that the moral burden for securing human rights should fall disproportionately upon such institutions precisely because they are best placed and most able to effectively perform the task. On this reading, non-governmental organizations and private citizens have an important role to play in supporting the global protection of human rights, but the onus must fall upon the relevant national and international institutions, such as the governments of nation-states and such bodies as the United Nations and the World Bank. One might wish to argue that, for example, human rights can be adequately secured by the existence of reciprocal duties held between individuals across the globe. However, 'privatizing' human rights in this fashion would ignore two particularly salient factors: individuals have a tendency to prioritise the moral demands of those closest to them, particularly members of their own family or immediate community; individuals' ability to exercise their duties is, to a large extent, determined by their own personal financial circumstances. Thus, global inequalities in the distribution of wealth fundamentally undermine the ability of those in the poorer countries to reciprocate assistance provided them by those living in wealthier countries. Reasons such as these underlie Pogge's insistence that the onus of responsibility lies at the level of national and international institutions. Adequately protecting and promoting human rights requires both nation-states ensuring the adequate provision of services and institutions for their own citizens and the co-operation of nation-states within international institutions acting to secure the requisite global conditions for the protection and promotion of everyone's human rights.

What must such bodies actively do to adequately secure individuals' human rights? Does my daughter’s human right to receive an adequate education require the education authority to do everything possible to assist and enhance my child's education? Does it require the provision of a world-class library, frequent study trips abroad, and employing the most able and best-qualified teachers? The answer is, of course, no. Given the relative scarcity of resources and the demands placed upon those resources, we are inclined to say that adequately securing individuals' human rights extends to the establishment of decent social and governmental practice so as to ensure that all individuals have the opportunity of leading a minimally good life. In the first instance, national governments are typically held to be primarily responsible for the adequate provision of their own citizens' human rights. Philosophers such as Brian Orend (2002) endorse this aspiration when he writes that the object of human rights is to secure 'minimal levels of decent and respectful treatment.' It is important to note, however, that the duty ensure the provision of even minimal levels of decent and respectful treatment cannot be strictly limited by national boundaries. The adequate protection and promotion of everyone's human rights does require, for example, the more affluent and powerful nation-states providing sufficient assistance to those countries currently incapable of adequately ensuring the protection of their own citizens' basic human rights. While some may consider Orend's aspirations for human rights to be unduly cautious, even the briefest survey of the extent of human suffering and deprivation in many parts of the world today is sufficient to demonstrate just how far we are from realizing even this fairly minimal standard.

National and international institutions bear the primary responsibility of securing human rights and the test for successfully fulfilling this responsibility is the creation of opportunities for all individuals to lead a minimally good life. The realization of human rights requires establishing the conditions for all human beings to lead minimally good lives and thus should not be confused as an attempt to create a morally perfect society. The impression that many have of human rights as being unduly utopian testifies less to the inherent demands of human rights and more to the extent to which even fairly modest aspirations are so far from being realized in the world today. The actual aspirations of human rights are, on the face of it, quite modest. However, this should not distract from a full appreciation of the possible force of human rights. Human rights call for the creation of politically democratic societies in which all citizens have the means of leading a minimally good life. While the object of individual human rights may be modest, the force of that right is intended to be near absolute. That is to say, the demands of rights are meant to take precedence over other possible social goals. Ronald Dworkin has coined the term 'rights as trumps' to describe this property. He writes that, 'rights are best understood as trumps over some background justification for political decisions that states a goal for the community as a whole.' (1977:153) In general, Dworkin argues, considerations of rights claims must take priority over alternative considerations when formulating public policy and distributing public benefits. Thus, for example, a minority's possession of rights against discriminatory treatment should trump any and all considerations of the possible benefits that the majority would derive from discriminating against the minority group. Similarly, an individual's right to an adequate diet should trump other individuals’ desires to eat lavish meals, despite the aggregate gain in pleasure these individuals would derive. For Dworkin, rights as trumps expresses the fundamental ideal of equality upon which the contemporary doctrine of human rights rests. Treating rights as trumps is a means for ensuring that all individuals are treated in an equal and like fashion in respect of the provision of fundamental human rights. Fully realizing the aspirations of human rights may not require the provision of 'state of the art' resources, but this should not detract from the force of human rights as taking priority over alternative social and political considerations.

4. Philosophical justifications of human rights

We have established that human rights originate as moral rights but that the successful passage of many human rights into international and national law enables one to think of human rights as, in many cases, both moral rights and legal rights. Furthermore, human rights may be either claim rights or liberty rights, and have a negative or a positive complexion in respect of the obligations imposed by others in securing the right. Human rights may be divided into five different categories and the principal object of securing human rights is the creation of the conditions for all individuals to have the opportunity to lead a minimally good life. Finally, human rights are widely considered to trump other social and political considerations in the allocation of public resources. Broadly speaking, philosophers generally agree on such issues as the formal properties of human rights, the object of human rights, and the force of human rights. However, there is much less agreement upon the fundamental question on how human rights may be philosophically justified. It would be fair to say that philosophers have provided many different, at times even conflicting, answers to this question. Philosophers have sought to justify human rights by appeal to single ideals such as equality, autonomy, human dignity, fundamental human interests, the capacity for rational agency, and even democracy. For the purposes of clarity and relative simplicity I will focus upon the two, presently most prominent, philosophical attempts to justify human rights: interests theory and will theory. Before I do that, it is necessary to address a prior question.

a. Do human rights require philosophical justification?

Many people tend to take the validity of human rights for granted. Certainly, for many non-philosophers human rights may all too obviously appear to rest upon self-evidently true and universally valid moral principles. In this respect, human rights may be perceived as empirical facts about the contemporary world. Human rights do exist and many people do act in accordance with the correlative duties and obligations respecting human rights entails. No supporter of human rights could possibly complain about such perceptions. If nothing else, the prevalence of such views is pragmatically valuable for the cause of human rights. However, moral philosophers do not enjoy such licence for epistemological complacency. Moral philosophers remain concerned by the question of the philosophical foundations of human rights. There is a good reason why we should all be concerned with such a question. What might be termed the 'philosophically naïve' view of human rights effectively construes human rights as legal rights. The validity of human rights is closely tied to, and dependent upon, the legal codification of human rights. However, as was argued earlier, such an approach is not sufficient to justify human rights. Arguments in support of the validity of any moral doctrine can never be settled by simply pointing to the empirical existence of particular moral beliefs or concepts. Morality is fundamentally concerned with what ought to be the case, and this cannot be settled by appeals to what is the case, or is perceived to be the case. From such a basis, it would have been very difficult to argue that apartheid South Africa, to take an earlier example, was a morally unjust regime. One must not confuse the law with morality, per se. Nor consider the two to be simply co-extensional. Human rights originate as moral rights. Human rights claim validity everywhere and for everyone, irrespective of whether they have received comprehensive legal recognition, and even irrespective of whether everyone is agreement with the claims and principles of human rights. Thus, one cannot settle the question of the philosophical validity of human rights by appealing to purely empirical observations upon the world. As a moral doctrine, human rights have to be demonstrated to be valid as norms and not facts. In order to achieve this, one has to turn to moral philosophy. Presently, two particular approaches to the question of the validity of human rights predominate: what might be loosely termed the 'interests theory approach' and the ‘will theory approach’.

b. The interests theory approach

Advocates of the interests theory approach argue that the principal function of human rights is to protect and promote certain essential human interests. Securing human beings' essential interests is the principal ground upon which human rights may be morally justified. The interests approach is thus primarily concerned to identify the social and biological prerequisites for human beings leading a minimally good life. The universality of human rights is grounded in what are considered to be some basic, indispensable, attributes for human well-being, which all of us are deemed necessarily to share. Take, for example, an interest each of us has in respect of our own personal security. This interest serves to ground our claim to the right. It may require the derivation of other rights as prerequisites to security, such as the satisfaction of basic nutritional needs and the need to be free from arbitrary detention or arrest, for example. The philosopher John Finnis provides a good representative of the interests theory approach. Finnis (1980) argues that human rights are justifiable on the grounds of their instrumental value for securing the necessary conditions of human well-being. He identifies seven fundamental interests, or what he terms 'basic forms of human good', as providing the basis for human rights. These are: life and its capacity for development; the acquisition of knowledge, as an end in itself; play, as the capacity for recreation; aesthetic expression; sociability and friendship; practical reasonableness, the capacity for intelligent and reasonable thought processes; and finally, religion, or the capacity for spiritual experience. According to Finnis, these are the essential prerequisites for human well-being and, as such, serve to justify our claims to the corresponding rights, whether they be of the claim right or liberty right variety.

Other philosophers who have defended human rights from an interests-based approach have addressed the question of how an appeal to interests can provide a justification for respecting and, when necessary, even positively acting to promote the interests of others. Such questions have a long heritage in western moral and political philosophy and extend at least as far back as the 17th. Century philosopher Thomas Hobbes. Typically, this approach attempts to provide what James Nickel (1987:84) has termed 'prudential reasons' in support of human rights. Taking as the starting point the claim that all human beings possess basic and fundamental interests, advocates of this approach argue that each individual owes a basic and general duty to respect the rights of every other individual. The basis for this duty is not mere benevolence or altruism, but individual self-interest. As Nickel writes, 'a prudential argument from fundamental interests attempts to show that it would be reasonable to accept and comply with human rights, in circumstances where most others are likely to do so, because these norms are part of the best means for protecting one's fundamental interests against actions and omissions that endanger them.' (ibid). Protecting one’s own fundamental interests requires others' willingness to recognize and respect these interests, which, in turn, requires reciprocal recognition and respect of the fundamental interests of others. The adequate protection of each individual's fundamental interests necessitates the establishment of a co-operative system, the fundamental aim of which is not to promote the common good, but the protection and promotion of individuals' self-interest.

For many philosophers the interests approach provides a philosophically powerful defence of the doctrine of human rights. It has the apparent advantage of appealing to human commonality, to those attributes we all share, and, in so doing, offers a relatively broad-based defence of the plethora of human rights considered by many to be fundamental and inalienable. The interests approach also provides for the possibility of resolving some of the potential disputes which can arise over the need to prioritise some human rights over others. One may do this, for example, by hierarchically ordering the corresponding interests identified as the specific object, or content, of each right.

However, the interests approach is subject to some significant criticisms. Foremost amongst these is the necessary appeal interests' theorists make to some account of human nature. The interests-approach is clearly operating with, at the very least, an implicit account of human nature. Appeals to human nature have, of course, proven to be highly controversial and typically resist achieving the degree of consensus required for establishing the legitimacy of any moral doctrine founded upon an account of human nature. For example, combining the appeal to fundamental interests with the aspiration of securing the conditions for each individual leading a minimally good life would be complicated by social and cultural diversity. Clearly, as the economic philosopher Amartya Sen (1999) has argued, the minimal conditions for a decent life are socially and culturally relative. Providing the conditions for leading a minimally good life for the residents of Greenwich Village would be significantly different to securing the same conditions for the residents of a shanty town in Southern Africa or South America. While the interests themselves may be ultimately identical, adequately protecting these interests will have to go beyond the mere specification of some purportedly general prerequisites for satisfying individuals' fundamental interests. Other criticisms of the interests approach have focused upon the appeal to self-interest as providing a coherent basis for fully respecting the rights of all human beings. This approach is based upon the assumption that individuals occupy a condition of relatively equal vulnerability to one another. However, this is simply not the case. The model cannot adequately defend the claim that a self-interested agent must respect the interests of, for example, much less powerful or geographically distant individuals, if she wishes to secure her own interests. On these terms, why should a purely self-interested and over-weight individual in, say, Los Angeles or London, care for the interests of a starving individual in some distant and impoverished continent? In this instance, the starving person is not in a position to affect their overweight counterpart's fundamental interests. The appeal to pure self-interest ultimately cannot provide a basis for securing the universal moral community at the heart of the doctrine of human rights. It cannot justify the claims of universal human rights. An even more philosophically oriented vein of criticism focuses upon the interests' based approach alleged neglect of constructive human agency as a fundamental component of morality generally. Put simply, the interests-based approach tends to construe our fundamental interests as pre-determinants of human moral agency. This can have the effect of subordinating the importance of the exercise of freedom as a principal moral ideal. One might seek to include freedom as a basic human interest, but freedom is not constitutive of our interests on this account. This particular concern lies at the heart of the so-called 'will approach' to human rights.

c. The Will Theory Approach

In contrast to the interests approach, the will theory attempts to establish the philosophical validity of human rights upon a single human attribute: the capacity for freedom. Will theorists argue that what is distinctive about human agency is the capacity for freedom and that this ought to constitute the core of any account of rights. Ultimately, then, will theorists view human rights as originating in, or reducible to, a single, constitutive right, or alternatively, a highly limited set of purportedly fundamental attributes. H.L.A. Hart, for example, inferentially argues that all rights are reducible to a single, fundamental right. He refers to this as 'equal right of all men to be free.' (1955:77). Hart insists that rights to such things as political participation or to an adequate diet, for example, are ultimately reducible to, and derivative of, individuals' equal right to liberty. Henry Shue (1996) develops upon Hart's inferential argument and argues that liberty alone is not ultimately sufficient for grounding all of the rights posited by Hart. Shue argues that many of these rights imply more than mere individual liberty and extend to include security from violence and the necessary material conditions for personal survival. Thus, he grounds rights upon liberty, security, and subsistence. The moral philosopher Alan Gewirth (1978, 1982) has further developed upon such themes. Gewirth argues that the justification of our claims to the possession of basic human rights is grounded in what he presents as the distinguishing characteristic of human beings generally: the capacity for rationally purposive agency. Gewirth states that the recognition of the validity of human rights is a logical corollary of recognizing oneself as a rationally purposive agent since the possession of rights are the necessary means for rationally purposive action. Gewirth grounds his argument in the claim that all human action is rationally purposive. Every human action is done for some reason, irrespective of whether it be a good or a bad reason. He argues that in rationally endorsing some end, say the desire to write a book, one must logically endorse the means to that end; as a bare minimum one's own literacy. He then asks what is required to be a rationally purposive agent in the first place? He answers that freedom and well-being are the two necessary conditions for rationally purposive action. Freedom and well-being are the necessary means to acting in a rationally purposive fashion. They are essential prerequisites for being human, where to be human is to possess the capacity for rationally purposive action. As essential prerequisites, each individual is entitled to have access to them. However, Gewirth argues that each individual cannot simply will their own enjoyment of these prerequisites for rational agency without due concern for others. He bases the necessary concern for others' human rights upon what he terms the 'principle of generic consistency' (PGC). Gewirth argues that each individual’s claim to the basic means for rationally purposive action is based upon an appeal to a general, rather than, specific attribute of all relevant agents. I cannot logically will my own claims to basic human rights without simultaneously accepting the equal claims of all rationally purposive agents to the same basic attributes. Gewirth has argued that there exists an absolute right to life possessed separately and equally by all of us. In so claiming, Gewirth echoes Dworkin's concept of rights as trumps, but ultimately goes further than Dworkin is prepared to do by arguing that the right to life is absolute and cannot, therefore, be overridden under any circumstances. He states that a 'right is absolute when it cannot be overridden in any circumstances, so that it can never be justifiably infringed and it must be fulfilled without any exceptions.' (1982:92). Will theorists then attempt to establish the validity of human rights upon the ideal of personal autonomy: rights are a manifestation of the exercise of personal autonomy. In so doing, the validity of human rights is necessarily tied to the validity of personal autonomy. On the face of it, this would appear to be a very powerful, philosophical position. After all, as someone like Gewirth might argue, critics of this position would themselves necessarily be acting autonomously and they cannot do this without simultaneously requiring the existence of the very means for such action: even in criticizing human rights one is logically pre-supposing the existence of such rights.

Despite the apparent logical force of the will approach, it has been subjected to various forms of criticism. A particularly important form of criticism focuses upon the implications of will theory for so-called 'marginal cases'; human beings who are temporarily or permanently incapable of acting in a rationally autonomous fashion. This would include individuals who have diagnosed from suffering from dementia, schizophrenia, clinical depression, and, also, individuals who remain in a comatose condition, from which they may never recover. If the constitutive condition for the possession of human rights is said to be the capacity for acting in a rationally purposive manner, for example, then it seems to logically follow, that individuals incapable of satisfying this criteria have no legitimate claim to human rights. Many would find this conclusion morally disturbing. However, a strict adherence to the will approach is entailed by it. Some human beings are temporarily or permanently lacking the criteria Gewirth, for instance, cites as the basis for our claims to human rights. It is difficult to see how they could be assimilated within the community of the bearers of human rights on the terms of Gewirth's argument. Despite this, the general tendency is towards extending human rights considerations towards many of the so-called 'marginal cases'. To do otherwise would appear to many to be intuitively wrong, if not ultimately defensible by appeal to practical reason. This may reveal the extent to which many peoples' support of human rights includes an ineluctable element of sympathy, taking the form of a general emotional concern for others. Thus, strictly applying the will theorists' criteria for membership of the community of human rights bearers would appear to result in the exclusion of some categories of human beings who are presently recognized as legitimate bearers of human rights.

The interests theory approach and the will theory approach contain strengths and weaknesses. When consistently and separately applied to the doctrine of human rights, each approach appears to yield conclusions that may limit or undermine the full force of those rights. It may be that philosophical supporters of human rights need to begin to consider the potential philosophical benefits attainable through combining various themes and elements found within these (and other) philosophical approaches to justifying human rights. Thus, further attempts at justifying the basis and content of human rights may benefit from pursuing a more thematically pluralist approach than has typically been the case to date.

5. Philosophical criticisms of human rights

The doctrine of human rights has been subjected to various forms of fundamental, philosophical criticism. These challenges to the philosophical validity of human rights as a moral doctrine differ from critical appraisals of the various philosophical theories supportive of the doctrine for the simple reason that they aim to demonstrate what they perceive to the philosophical fallacies upon which human rights are founded. Two such forms of critical analysis bear particular attention: one which challenges the universalist claims of human rights, and another which challenges the presumed objective character of human rights principles.

a. Moral relativism

Philosophical supporters of human rights are necessarily committed to a form of moral universalism. As moral principles and as a moral doctrine, human rights are considered to be universally valid. However, moral universalism has long been subject to criticism by so-called moral relativists. Moral relativists argue that universally valid moral truths do not exist. For moral relativists, there is simply no such thing as a universally valid moral doctrine. Relativists view morality as a social and historical phenomenon. Moral beliefs and principles are therefore thought of as socially and historically contingent, valid only for those cultures and societies in which they originate and within which they are widely approved. Relativists point to the vast array of diverse moral beliefs and practices apparent in the world today as empirical support for their position. Even within a single, contemporary society, such as the United States or Great Britain, one can find a wide diversity of fundamental moral beliefs, principles, and practices. Contemporary, complex societies are thus increasingly considered to be pluralist and multicultural in character. For many philosophers the multicultural character of such societies serves to fundamentally restrict the substance and scope of the regulative political principles governing those societies. In respect of human rights, relativists have tended to focus upon such issues as the presumed individualist character of the doctrine of human rights. It has been argued by numerous relativists that human rights are unduly biased towards morally individualist societies and cultures, at the necessary expense of the communal moral complexion of many Asian and African societies. At best, some human rights' articles may be considered to be redundant within such societies, at worse they may appear to be positively harmful if fully implemented, replacing the fundamental values of one civilization with those of another and thereby perpetuating a form of cultural and moral imperialism.

The philosophical debate between universalists and relativists is far too complex to adequately summarise here. However, certain immediate responses to the relativist critique of human rights are immediately available. First, merely pointing to moral diversity and the presumed integrity of individual cultures and societies does not, by itself, provide a philosophical justification for relativism, nor a sufficient critique of universalism. After all, there have existed and continue to exist many cultures and societies whose treatment of their own people leaves much to be desired. Is the relativist genuinely asking us to recognize and respect the integrity of Nazi Germany, or any other similarly repressive regime? There can be little doubt that, as it stands, relativism is incompatible with human rights. On the face of it, this would appear to lend argumentative weight to the universalist support of human rights. After all, one may speculate as to the willingness of any relativist to actually forego their possession of human rights if and when the social surroundings demanded it. Similarly, relativist arguments are typically presented by members of the political elites within those countries whose systematic oppression of their peoples has attracted the attention of advocates of human rights. The exponential growth of grass-roots human rights organizations across many countries in the world whose cultures are alleged to be incompatible with the implementation of human rights, raises serious questions as to the validity and integrity of such 'indigenous' relativists. At its worst, the doctrine of moral relativism may be being deployed in an attempt to illegitimately justify oppressive political systems. The concern over the presumed incompatibility between human rights and communal moral systems appears to be a more valid issue. Human rights have undeniably conceived of the principal bearer of human rights as the individual person. This is due, in large part, to the Western origins of human rights. However, it would be equally fair to say that the so-called 'third generation' of human rights is far more attuned to the communal and collective basis of many individuals' lives. In keeping with the work of political philosophers such as Will Kymlicka, there is increasing awareness of the need to tailor human rights principles to such things as the collective rights of minorities and, for example, these minorities' claims to such things as communal land rights. While human rights remain philosophically grounded within an individualist moral doctrine, there can be no doubt that attempts are being made to adequately apply and human rights to more communally oriented societies. Human rights can no longer be accused of being 'culture-blind'.

b. Epistemological criticisms of human rights

The second most important contemporary philosophical form of human rights' criticism challenges the presumed objective basis of human rights as moral rights. This form of criticism may be thought of as a river into which run many philosophical tributaries. The essence of these attempts to refute human rights consists in the claim that moral principles and concepts are inherently subjective in character. On this view moral beliefs do not emanate from a correct determination of a rationally purposive will, or even gaining insight into the will of some divine being. Rather, moral beliefs are fundamentally expressions of individuals' partial preferences. This position therefore rejects the principal ground upon which the concept of moral rights rests: that there exist rational and a priori moral principles upon which a correct and legitimate moral doctrine is to be founded. In modern, as opposed to ancient, philosophy this argument is most closely associated with the 18th. Century Scottish philosopher David Hume. More recently versions of it have been defended by the likes of C.L.Stevenson, Ludwig Wittgenstein, J.L.Mackie, and Richard Rorty. Indeed, Rorty (1993) has argued that human rights are based not upon the exercise of reason, but a sentimental vision of humanity. He insists that human rights are not rationally defensible. He argues that one cannot justify the basis of human rights by appeal to moral theory and the canons of reason since, he insists, moral beliefs and practices are not ultimately motivated by an appeal to reason or moral theory, but emanate from a sympathetic identification with others: morality originates in the heart, and not in the head. Interestingly, though unambiguously sceptical about the philosophical basis of human rights, Rorty views the existence of human rights as a 'good and desirable thing', something whose existence we all benefit from. His critique of human rights is this not motivated by an underlying hostility to the doctrine. For Rorty, human rights are better served by emotional appeals to identify with the unnecessary suffering of others, than by arguments over the correct determination of reason.

Rorty's emphasis upon the importance of an emotional identification with others is a legitimate concern. It may, for example, provide additional support for the philosophical arguments presented by the likes of Gewirth. However, as Michael Freeman has recently pointed out, 'Rorty's argument…confuses motivation and justification. Sympathy is an emotion. Whether the action we take on the basis of our emotions is justified depends on the reasons for the action. Rorty wishes to eliminate unprovable metaphysical theories from philosophy, but in his critique of human-rights theory he goes too far, and eliminates reasoning.' (2002:56) Rorty’s own account of the basis and scope of moral knowledge ultimately prohibits him from claiming that human rights is a morally desirable phenomenon, since he explicitly rules out the validity of appealing to the independently verifiable criteria required to uphold any such judgement. What we require from Rorty is an independent reason for accepting his conclusion. It is precisely this that he denies may be legitimately provided by moral philosophy.

Rorty aside, the general critique of moral objectivity has a long and very well-established heritage in modern moral philosophy. It would be false to claim that either the objectivists or the subjectivists have scored any ultimate 'knock-down' over their philosophical opponents. Human rights are founded upon the claim to moral objectivity, whether by appeal to interests or the will. Any critique of moral objectivism is bound, therefore, to have repercussions for the philosophical defence of human rights. As I noted above, philosophers such as Alan Gewirth and John Finnis, in their separate and different ways, have attempted to establish the rational and objective force of human rights. The reader interested in pursuing this particular theme further is therefore recommended to pursue a close philosophical analysis of either, or both, of these two philosophers.

6. Conclusion

Human rights have a long historical heritage. The principal philosophical foundation of human rights is a belief in the existence of a form of justice valid for all peoples, everywhere. In this form, the contemporary doctrine of human rights has come to occupy centre stage in geo-political affairs. The language of human rights is understood and utilized by many peoples in very diverse circumstances. Human rights have become indispensable to the contemporary understanding of how human beings should be treated, by one another and by national and international political bodies. Human rights are best thought of as potential moral guarantees for each human being to lead a minimally good life. The extent to which this aspiration has not been realized represents a gross failure by the contemporary world to institute a morally compelling order based upon human rights. The philosophical basis of human rights has been subjected to consistent criticism. While some aspects of the ensuing debate between philosophical supporters and opponents of human rights remain unresolved and, perhaps, irresolvable, the general case for human rights remains a morally powerful one. Arguably, the most compelling motivation for the existence of human may rest upon the exercise of imagination. Try imagining a world without human rights!

7. References and Further Reading

  • Dworkin, Ronald. Taking Rights Seriously, (London: Duckworth, 1978)
  • Freeman, Michael. Human Rights: An Interdisciplinary Approach, (Cambridge: Polity, 2002)
  • Finnis, John. Natural Law and Natural Rights, (Oxford; Clarendon Press, 1980)
  • Gewirth, Alan. Reason and Morality, (Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1978)
  • Gewirth, Alan. Human Rights: Essays on Justification and Applications, (Chicago; University of Chicago Press, 1982)
  • Jones, Peter. Rights, (Basingstoke; Macmillan, 1994)
  • Mackie, J.L. Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong, (Harmondsworth; Penguin, 1977)
  • Nickel, James. Making Sense of Human Rights: Philosophical Reflections on the Universal Declaration of Human Rights, (Berkeley; University of California Press, 1987)
  • Rorty, Richard. "Human rights, rationality, and sentimentality". In S.Shute & S. Hurley (eds.) On Human Rights: the Oxford Amnesty Lectures 1993, (New York; Basic Books, 1993)
  • Waldron, Jeremy. Theories of Rights, (Oxford; Oxford University Press, 1984) Chapters by Ronald Dworkin, Alan Gewirth, and H.L.A.Hart

Author Information

Andrew Fagan
University of Essex
United Kingdom

Legal Positivism

Legal positivism is a philosophy of law that emphasizes the conventional nature of law—that it is socially constructed. According to legal positivism, law is synonymous with positive norms, that is, norms made by the legislator or considered as common law or case law. Formal criteria of law’s origin, law enforcement and legal effectiveness are all sufficient for social norms to be considered law.  Legal positivism does not base law on divine commandments, reason, or human rights.  As an historical matter, positivism arose in opposition to classical natural law theory, according to which there are necessary moral constraints on the content of law.

Legal positivism does not imply an ethical justification for the content of the law, nor a decision for or against the obedience to law. Positivists do not judge laws by questions of justice or humanity, but merely by the ways in which the laws have been created. This includes the view that judges make new law in deciding cases not falling clearly under a legal rule. Practicing, deciding or tolerating certain practices of law can each be considered a way of creating law.

Within legal doctrine, legal positivism would be opposed to sociological jurisprudence and hermeneutics of law, which study the concrete prevailing circumstances of statutory interpretation in society.

The word “positivism” was probably first used to draw attention to the idea that law is “positive” or “posited,” as opposed to being “natural” in the sense of being derived from natural law or morality.

Table of Contents

  1. The Pedigree Thesis
  2. The Separability Thesis
    1. Inclusive vs. Exclusive Positivism
  3. The Discretion Thesis
  4. Classic Criticisms of Positivism
    1. Fuller's Internal Morality of Law
    2. Positivism and Legal Principles
    3. The Semantic Sting
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Pedigree Thesis

The pedigree thesis asserts that legal validity is a function of certain social facts. Borrowing heavily from Jeremy Bentham, John Austin argues that the principal distinguishing feature of a legal system is the presence of a sovereign who is habitually obeyed by most people in the society, but not in the habit of obeying any determinate human superior (Austin 1995, p. 166). On Austin's view, a rule R is legally valid (that is, is a law) in a society S if and only if R is commanded by the sovereign in S and is backed up with the threat of a sanction. The severity of the threatened sanction is irrelevant; any general sovereign imperative supported by a threat of even the smallest harm is a law.

Austin's command theory of law is vulnerable to a number of criticisms. One problem is that there appears to be no identifiable sovereign in democratic societies. In the United States, for example, the ultimate political power seems to belong to the people, who elect lawmakers to represent their interests. Elected lawmakers have the power to coerce behavior but are regarded as servants of the people and not as repositories of sovereign power. The voting population, on the other hand, seems to be the repository of ultimate political authority yet lacks the immediate power to coerce behavior. Thus, in democracies like that of the United States, the ultimate political authority and the power to coerce behavior seem to reside in different entities.

A second problem has to do with Austin's view that the sovereign lawmaking authority is incapable of legal limitation. On Austin's view, a sovereign cannot be legally constrained because no person (or body of persons) can coerce herself (or itself). Since constitutional provisions limit the authority of the legislative body to make laws, Austin is forced to argue that what we refer to as constitutional law is really not law at all; rather, it is principally a matter of "positive morality" (Austin 1977, p. 107).

Austin's view is difficult to reconcile with constitutional law in the United States. Courts regard the procedural and substantive provisions of the constitution as constraints on legal validity. The Supreme Court has held, for example, that "an unconstitutional act is not a law; it confers no rights; it imposes no duties; it is, in legal contemplation, as inoperative as though it had never been passed." (Norton v. Shelby County, 118 U.S. 425 (1886)). Moreover, these constraints purport to be legal constraints: the Supremacy Clause of Article VI of the Constitution states that "[t]his Constitution ... shall be the supreme Law of the Land; and the Judges in every State shall be bound thereby."

The most influential criticisms of Austin's version of the pedigree thesis, however, owe to H. L. A. Hart's seminal work, The Concept of Law. Hart points out that Austin's theory provides, at best, a partial account of legal validity because it focuses on one kind of rule, namely that which requires citizens "to do or abstain from certain actions, whether they wish to or not" (Hart 1994, p. 81). While every legal system must contain so-called primary rules that regulate citizen behavior, Hart believes a system consisting entirely of the kind of liberty restrictions found in the criminal law is, at best, a rudimentary or primitive legal system.

On Hart's view, Austin's emphasis on coercive force leads him to overlook the presence of a second kind of primary rule that confers upon citizens the power to create, modify, and extinguish rights and obligations in other persons. As Hart points out, the rules governing the creation of contracts and wills cannot plausibly be characterized as restrictions on freedom that are backed by the threat of a sanction. These rules empower persons to structure their legal relations within the coercive framework of the law-a feature that Hart correctly regards as one of "law's greatest contributions to social life." The operation of power-conferring primary rules, according to Hart, indicates the presence of a more sophisticated system for regulating behavior.

But what ultimately distinguishes societies with full-blown systems of law from those with only rudimentary or primitive forms of law is that the former have, in addition to first-order primary rules, secondary meta-rules that have as their subject matter the primary rules themselves:

[Secondary rules] may all be said to be on a different level from the primary rules, for they are all about such rules; in the sense that while primary rules are concerned with the actions that individuals must or must not do, these secondary rules are all concerned with the primary rules themselves. They specify the way in which the primary rules may be conclusively ascertained, introduced, eliminated, varied, and the fact of their violation conclusively determined (Hart 1994, p. 92).

Hart distinguishes three types of secondary rules that mark the transition from primitive forms of law to full-blown legal systems: (1) the rule of recognition, which "specif[ies] some feature or features possession of which by a suggested rule is taken as a conclusive affirmative indication that it is a rule of the group to be supported by the social pressure it exerts" (Hart 1994, p. 92); (2) the rule of change, which enables a society to add, remove, and modify valid rules; and (3) the rule of adjudication, which provides a mechanism for determining whether a valid rule has been violated. On Hart's view, then, every society with a full-blown legal system necessarily has a rule of recognition that articulates criteria for legal validity that include provisions for making, changing and adjudicating law. Law is, to use Hart's famous phrase, "the union of primary and secondary rules" (Hart 1994, p. 107). Austin theory fails, on Hart's view, because it fails to acknowledge the importance of secondary rules in manufacturing legal validity.

Hart also finds fault with Austin's view that legal obligation is essentially coercive. According to Hart, there is no difference between the Austinian sovereign who governs by coercing behavior and the gunman who orders someone to hand over her money. In both cases, the subject can plausibly be characterized as being "obliged" to comply with the commands, but not as being "duty-bound" or "obligated" to do so (Hart 1994, p. 80). On Hart's view, the application of coercive force alone can never give rise to an obligation-legal or otherwise.

Legal rules are obligatory, according to Hart, because people accept them as standards that justify criticism and, in extreme cases, punishment of deviations:

What is necessary is that there should be a critical reflective attitude to certain patterns of behavior as a common standard, and that this should display itself in criticism (including self-criticism), demands for conformity, and in acknowledgements that such criticism and demands are justified, all of which find their characteristic expression in the normative terminology of 'ought', 'must', and 'should', and 'right' and 'wrong' (Hart 1994, p. 56).

The subject who reflectively accepts the rule as providing a standard that justifies criticism of deviations is said to take "the internal point of view" towards it.

On Hart's view, it would be too much to require that the bulk of the population accept the rule of recognition as the ultimate criteria for legal validity: "the reality of the situation is that a great proportion of ordinary citizens-perhaps a majority-have no general conception of the legal structure or its criteria of validity" (Hart 1994, p. 111). Instead, Hart argues that what is necessary to the existence of a legal system is that the majority of officials take the internal point of view towards the rule of recognition and its criteria of validity. All that is required of citizens is that they generally obey the primary rules that are legally valid according to the rule of recognition.

Thus, on Hart's view, there are two minimum conditions sufficient and necessary for the existence of a legal system: "On the one hand those rules of behavior which are valid according to the system's ultimate criteria of validity must be generally obeyed, and, on the other hand, its rules of recognition specifying the criteria of legal validity and its rules of change and adjudication must be effectively accepted as common public standards of official behavior by its officials" (Hart 1994, p. 113).

Hart's view is vulnerable to the same criticism that he levels against Austin. Hart rejects Austin's view because the institutional application of coercive force can no more give rise to an obligation than can the application of coercive force by a gunman. But the situation is no different if the gunman takes the internal point of view towards his authority to make such a threat. Despite the gunman's belief that he is entitled to make the threat, the victim is obliged, but not obligated, to comply with the gunman's orders. The gunman's behavior is no less coercive because he believes he is entitled to make the threat.

Similarly, in the minimal legal system, only the officials of the legal system take the internal point of view towards the rule of recognition that endows them with authority to make, execute, adjudicate, and enforce the rules. The mere presence of a belief in the officials that they are entitled to make law cannot give rise to an obligation in other people to comply with their enactments any more than the presence of a belief on the part of a gunman that he is entitled to issue orders gives rise to an obligation in the victim to comply with those orders. Hart's minimal legal system is no less coercive than Austin's legal system.

2. The Separability Thesis

The second thesis comprising the foundation of legal positivism is the separability thesis. In its most general form, the separability thesis asserts that law and morality are conceptually distinct. This abstract formulation can be interpreted in a number of ways. For example, Klaus Faber (1996) interprets it as making a meta-level claim that the definition of law must be entirely free of moral notions. This interpretation implies that any reference to moral considerations in defining the related notions of law, legal validity, and legal system is inconsistent with the separability thesis.

More commonly, the separability thesis is interpreted as making only an object-level claim about the existence conditions for legal validity. As H.L.A. Hart describes it, the separability thesis is no more than the "simple contention that it is in no sense a necessary truth that laws reproduce or satisfy certain demands of morality, though in fact they have often done so" (Hart 1994, pp. 181-82). Insofar as the object-level interpretation of the separability thesis denies it is a necessary truth that there are moral constraints on legal validity, it implies the existence of a possible legal system in which there are no moral constraints on legal validity.

a. Inclusive vs. Exclusive Positivism

Though all positivists agree there are possible legal systems without moral constraints on legal validity, there are conflicting views on whether there are possible legal systems with such constraints. According to inclusive positivism (also known as incorporationism and soft positivism), it is possible for a society's rule of recognition to incorporate moral constraints on the content of law. Prominent inclusive positivists include Jules Coleman and H.L.A. Hart, who maintains that "the rule of recognition may incorporate as criteria of legal validity conformity with moral principles or substantive values ... such as the Sixteenth or Nineteenth Amendments to the United States Constitution respecting the establishment of religion or abridgements of the right to vote" (Hart 1994, p. 250).

In contrast, exclusive positivism (also called hard positivism) denies that a legal system can incorporate moral constraints on legal validity. Exclusive positivists like Joseph Raz (1979, p. 47) subscribe to the source thesis, according to which the existence and content of law can always be determined by reference to its sources without recourse to moral argument. On this view, the sources of law include both the circumstances of its promulgation and relevant interpretative materials, such as court cases involving its application.

At first glance, exclusive positivism may seem difficult to reconcile with what appear to be moral criteria of legal validity in legal systems like that of the United States. For example, the Fourth Amendment provides that "[t]he right of the people to be secure in their persons, houses, papers, and effects against unreasonable searches and seizures, shall not be violated." Likewise, the First Amendment prohibits laws abridging the right of free speech. Taken at face value, these amendments seem to make moral standards part of the conditions for legal validity.

Exclusive positivists argue that such amendments can require judges to consider moral standards in certain circumstances, but cannot incorporate those standards into the law. When a judge makes reference to moral considerations in deciding a case, she necessarily creates new law on an issue-and this is so even when the law directs her to consider moral considerations, as the Bill of Rights does in certain circumstances. On this view, all law is settled law and questions of settled law can be resolved without recourse to moral arguments:

The law on a question is settled when legally binding sources provide its solution. In such cases judges are typically said to apply the law, and since it is source-based, its application involves technical, legal skills in reasoning from those sources and does not call for moral acumen. If a legal question is not answered by standards deriving from legal sources then it lacks a legal answer-the law on such questions is unsettled. In deciding such cases courts inevitably break new (legal) ground and their decision develops the law.... Naturally, their decisions in such cases rely at least partly on moral and other extra-legal considerations (Raz 1979, pp. 49-50).

If the judge can resolve an issue involving the First Amendment merely by applying past court decisions, then the issue is settled by the law; if not, then the issue is unsettled. Insofar as the judge looks to controversial moral standards to resolve the issue, she is going beyond the law because the mere presence of controversy about the law implies that it is indeterminate. Thus, on Raz's view, references to moral language in the law, at most, direct judges to consider moral requirements in resolving certain unsettled questions of law. They cannot incorporate moral requirements into the law.

3. The Discretion Thesis

Third thesis commonly associated with positivism is the discretion thesis, according to which judges decide difficult cases by making new law in the exercise of discretion. Ronald Dworkin describes this thesis as follows:

The set of these valid legal rules is exhaustive of 'the law', so that if someone's case is not clearly covered by such a rule . . . then that case cannot be decided by 'applying the law.' It must be decided by some official, like a judge, 'exercising his discretion,' which means reaching beyond the law for some other sort of standard to guide him in manufacturing a fresh legal rule or supplementing an old one (Dworkin 1977, p. 17).

On this view, a judge cannot decide a case that does not fall clearly under a valid rule by interpreting or applying the law; she must decide the case by creating or promulgating a law that did not exist prior to the adjudication. Thus, the discretion thesis implies that judges are empowered with a quasi-legislative lawmaking authority in cases that cannot be decided merely by applying law.

Though often associated with positivism, the discretion thesis does not belong to positivism's theoretical core. The pedigree and separability theses purport to be conceptual claims that are true of every possible legal system. These two claims jointly assert that, in every possible legal system, propositions of law are valid in virtue of having been manufactured according to some set of social conventions. On this view, there are no moral constraints on the content of law that hold in every possible legal system.

But many positivists regard the discretion thesis as a contingent claim that is true of some, but not all, possible legal systems. Hart, for example, believes there will inevitably arise cases that do not fall clearly under a rule, but concedes a rule of recognition could deny judges discretion to make law in such cases by requiring judges "to disclaim jurisdiction or to refer the points not regulated by the existing law to the legislature to decide" (Hart 1994, p. 272). Indeed, Hart's inclusive positivism allows him to hold that a rule of recognition could require judges to decide cases in precisely the manner that Dworkin advocates (Hart 1994, p. 263; and see Section IV-2, infra). Thus, at least for inclusive positivists like Hart, the discretion thesis makes a different kind of claim than the conceptual claims that form positivism's theoretical core (Himma 1999).

Moreover, the discretion thesis is consistent with some forms of natural law theory. According to Blackstone's classical naturalism, conformity with the natural law is a necessary condition for legal validity in every possible legal system. But insofar as the natural law is incomplete, there will inevitably arise issues that have multiple outcomes consistent with the natural law. Since none of the relevant outcomes in such cases offend the natural law, there is nothing in the assumption of necessary moral constraints on the content of law, in and of itself, that precludes Blackstone from endorsing the discretion thesis in such cases. Of course, if Blackstone believes the natural law contains a principle denying discretion to judges, then that commitment is inconsistent with the discretion thesis. But the assertion there are necessary constraints on the content of law, in and of itself, is consistent with the discretion thesis, even construed as a conceptual claim, as long as there are cases to which the natural law is indifferent.

In any event, Dworkin distinguishes three different senses in which a judge might be said to have discretion: (1) a judge has discretion when she exercises judgment in applying a legal standard to a particular case; (2) a judge has discretion when her decision is not subject to reversal by any other authority; and (3) a judge has discretion when her decision is not bound by any legal standards.

According to Dworkin, positivism's discretion thesis is committed to the third sense of discretion, which he refers to as strong discretion. On Dworkin's view, the thesis that judges have discretion only in the sense that they exercise judgment is trivially true, while the thesis that judges have discretion in the sense that their decisions are not subject to being reversed by a higher authority is false. Even the Supreme Court can be reversed by Congress or by constitutional amendment. Thus, on Dworkin's view, the discretion thesis implies that judges have discretion to decide hard cases by what amounts to an act of legislation because the judge is not bound by any legal standards.

Thus construed, the discretion thesis is inconsistent with ordinary legal practice. Even in the most difficult of cases where there is no clearly applicable law, lawyers do not ask that the judge decide the relevant issue by making new law. Each lawyer cites cases favorable to her client's position and argues that the judge is bound by those cases to decide in her client's favor. As a practical matter, lawyers rarely, if ever, concede there are no legal standards governing a case and ask the judge to legislate in the exercise of discretion.

Nevertheless, the problem with Dworkin's analysis is that it falsely presupposes an official cannot make new law unless there are no legal standards constraining the official's decision. Indeed, lawmaking authorities in legal systems like the U.S. never have what Dworkin describes as strong discretion. Even the legislative decisions of Congress, the highest legislative authority in the nation, are always constrained by constitutional standards. For example, under the Fourteenth Amendment, Congress cannot enact a law that sets one speed limit for male drivers on interstate highways and another for female drivers.

For his part, Hart concedes that judicial lawmaking authority is limited in two respects: "not only are the judge's powers subject to many constraints narrowing his choice from which a legislature may be quite free, but since the judge's powers are exercised only to dispose of particular instant cases he cannot use these to introduce large-scale reforms or new codes" (Hart 1994, p. 273). What explains the judge's discretion to make new law in a given case, on Hart's view, is not the absence of legal standards constraining her decision; rather it is the absence of legal standards that dictate a uniquely correct answer to the case. The judge cannot decide such a case merely by applying existing law because there is more than one available outcome that coheres with existing law. In such instances, it is impossible to render a substantive decision (as opposed to simply referring the matter back to the legislature) without creating new law.

The discretion thesis is vulnerable to one powerful objection. Insofar as a judge decides a difficult case by making new law in the exercise of discretion, the case is being decided on the basis of a law that did not exist at the time the dispute arose. If, for example, a judge awards damages to a plaintiff by making new law in the exercise of discretion, it follows that she has held the defendant liable under a law that did not exist at the time the dispute arose. And, as Dworkin points out, it seems patently unfair to deprive a defendant of property for behavior that did not give rise to liability at the time the behavior occurred.

Nevertheless, Dworkin's view fares no better on this count. While Dworkin acknowledges the existence of difficult cases that do not fall clearly under a rule, he believes they are not resolved by an exercise of judicial discretion. On Dworkin's view, there is always a right answer to such cases implicit in the pre-existing law. Of course, it sometimes takes a judge of Herculean intellectual ability to discern what the right answer is, but it is always there to be found in pre-existing law. Since the right answer to even hard legal disputes is always part of pre-existing law, Dworkin believes that a judge can take property from a defendant in a hard case without unfairness (Dworkin 1977, pp. 87-130).

But if fairness precludes taking property from a defendant under a law that did not exist at the time of the relevant behavior, it also precludes taking property from a defendant under a law that did not give reasonable notice that the relevant behavior gives rise to liability. Due process and fundamental fairness require reasonable notice of which behaviors give rise to liability. As long as Dworkin acknowledges the existence of cases so difficult that only the best of judges can solve them, his theory is vulnerable to the same charge of unfairness that he levels at the discretion thesis.

4. Classic Criticisms of Positivism

a. Fuller's Internal Morality of Law

In The Morality of Law, Lon L. Fuller argues that law is subject to an internal morality consisting of eight principles: (P1) the rules must be expressed in general terms; (P2) the rules must be publicly promulgated; (P3) the rules must be (for the most part) prospective in effect; (P4) the rules must be expressed in understandable terms; (P5) the rules must be consistent with one another; (P6) the rules must not require conduct beyond the powers of the affected parties; (P7) the rules must not be changed so frequently that the subject cannot rely on them; and (P8) the rules must be administered in a manner consistent with their wording (Fuller 1964, p. 39).

On Fuller's view, no system of rules that fails minimally to satisfy these principles of legality can achieve law's essential purpose of achieving social order through the use of rules that guide behavior. A system of rules that fails to satisfy (P2) or (P4), for example, cannot guide behavior because people will not be able to determine what the rules require. Accordingly, Fuller concludes that his eight principles are "internal" to law in the sense that they are built into the existence conditions for law: "A total failure in any one of these eight directions does not simply result in a bad system of law; it results in something that is not properly called a legal system at all" (Fuller 1964, p. 39).

These internal principles constitute a morality, according to Fuller, because law necessarily has positive moral value in two respects: (1) law conduces to a state of social order and (2) does so by respecting human autonomy because rules guide behavior. Since no system of rules can achieve these morally valuable objectives without minimally complying with the principles of legality, it follows, on Fuller's view, that they constitute a morality. Since these moral principles are built into the existence conditions for law, they are internal and hence represent a conceptual connection between law and morality that is inconsistent with the separability thesis.

Hart responds by denying Fuller's claim that the principles of legality constitute an internal morality; on Hart's view, Fuller confuses the notions of morality and efficacy:

[T]he author's insistence on classifying these principles of legality as a "morality" is a source of confusion both for him and his readers.... [T]he crucial objection to the designation of these principles of good legal craftsmanship as morality, in spite of the qualification "inner," is that it perpetrates a confusion between two notions that it is vital to hold apart: the notions of purposive activity and morality. Poisoning is no doubt a purposive activity, and reflections on its purpose may show that it has its internal principles. ("Avoid poisons however lethal if they cause the victim to vomit"....) But to call these principles of the poisoner's art "the morality of poisoning" would simply blur the distinction between the notion of efficiency for a purpose and those final judgments about activities and purposes with which morality in its various forms is concerned (Hart 1965, pp. 1285-86).

On Hart's view, all actions, including virtuous acts like lawmaking and impermissible acts like poisoning, have their own internal standards of efficacy. But insofar as such standards of efficacy conflict with morality, as they do in the case of poisoning, it follows that they are distinct from moral standards. Thus, while Hart concedes that something like Fuller's eight principles are built into the existence conditions for law, he concludes that they do not constitute a conceptual connection between law and morality.

Unfortunately, Hart's response overlooks the fact that most of Fuller's eight principles double as moral ideals of fairness. For example, public promulgation in understandable terms may be a necessary condition for efficacy, but it is also a moral ideal; it is morally objectionable for a state to enforce rules that have not been publicly promulgated in terms reasonably calculated to give notice of what is required. Similarly, we take it for granted that it is wrong for a state to enact retroactive rules, inconsistent rules, and rules that require what is impossible. Poisoning may have its internal standards of efficacy, but such standards are distinguishable from the principles of legality in that they conflict with moral ideals.

Nevertheless, Fuller's principles operate internally, not as moral ideals, but merely as principles of efficacy. As Fuller would likely acknowledge, the existence of a legal system is consistent with considerable divergence from the principles of legality. Legal standards, for example, are necessarily promulgated in general terms that inevitably give rise to problems of vagueness. And officials all too often fail to administer the laws in a fair and even-handed manner-even in the best of legal systems. These divergences may always be prima facie objectionable, but they are inconsistent with a legal system only when they render a legal system incapable of performing its essential function of guiding behavior. Insofar as these principles are built into the existence conditions for law, it is because they operate as efficacy conditions-and not because they function as moral ideals.

Fuller's jurisprudential legacy, however, should not be underestimated. While positivists have long acknowledged that law's essential purpose is to guide behavior through rules (e.g., John Austin writes that "[a] law .. may be defined as a rule laid down for the guidance of an intelligent being by an intelligent being having power over him" Austin 1977, p. 5), they have not always appreciated the implications of this purpose. Fuller's lasting contribution to the theory of law was to flesh out these implications in the form of his principles of legality.

b. Positivism and Legal Principles

Dworkin argues that, in deciding hard cases, judges often invoke legal principles that do not derive their authority from an official act of promulgation (Dworkin 1977, p. 40). These principles, Dworkin believes, must be characterized as law because judges are bound to consider them when relevant. But if unpromulgated legal principles constitute law, then it is false, contra the pedigree thesis, that a proposition of law is valid only in virtue of having been formally promulgated.

According to Dworkin, principles and rules differ in the kind of guidance they provide to judges:

Rules are applicable in an all-or-nothing fashion. If the facts a rule stipulates are given, then either the rule is valid, in which case the answer it supplies must be accepted, or it is not, in which case it contributes nothing to the decision.... But this is not the way principles operate.... [A principle] states a reason that argues in one direction, but does not necessitate a particular decision (Dworkin 1977, pp. 24-25).

On Dworkin's view, conflicting principles provide competing reasons that must be weighed according to the importance of the respective values they express. Thus, rules are distinguishable from principles in two related respects: (1) rules necessitate, where principles only suggest, a particular outcome; and (2) principles have, where rules lack, the dimension of weight.

Dworkin cites the case of Riggs v. Palmer as representative of how judges use principles to decide hard cases. In Riggs, the court considered the question of whether a murderer could take under the will of his victim. At the time the case was decided, neither the statutes nor the case law governing wills expressly prohibited a murderer from taking under his victim's will. Despite this, the court declined to award the defendant his gift under the will on the ground that it would be wrong to allow him to profit from such a grievous wrong. On Dworkin's view, the court decided the case by citing "the principle that no man may profit from his own wrong as a background standard against which to read the statute of wills and in this way justified a new interpretation of that statute" (Dworkin 1977, p. 29).

The positivist might respond that when the Riggs court considered this principle, it was reaching beyond the law to extralegal standards in the exercise of judicial discretion. But Dworkin points out that the Riggs judges would "rightfully" have been criticized had they failed to consider this principle; if it were merely an extralegal standard, there would be no rightful grounds to criticize a failure to consider it (Dworkin 1977, p. 35). Accordingly, Dworkin concludes that the best explanation for the propriety of such criticism is that principles are part of the law.

Further, Dworkin maintains that the legal authority of standards like the Riggs principle cannot derive from promulgation in accordance with purely formal requirements: "[e]ven though principles draw support from the official acts of legal institutions, they do not have a simple or direct enough connection with these acts to frame that connection in terms of criteria specified by some ultimate master rule of recognition" (Dworkin 1977, p. 41). Unlike legal rules, legal principles lack a canonical form and hence cannot be explained by formal promulgation.

On Dworkin's view, the legal authority of a binding principle derives from the contribution it makes to the best moral justification for a society's legal practices considered as a whole. According to Dworkin, a legal principle maximally contributes to such a justification if and only if it satisfies two conditions: (1) the principle coheres with existing legal materials; and (2) the principle is the most morally attractive standard that satisfies (1). The correct legal principle is the one that makes the law the moral best it can be. Thus, Dworkin concludes, "if we treat principles as law we must reject the positivists' first tenet, that the law of a community is distinguished from other social standards by some test in the form of a master rule" (Dworkin 1977, p. 44).

In response, positivists concede that there are legal principles, but argue that their authority as law can be explained in terms of the conventions contained in the rule of recognition:

Legal principles, like other laws, can be enacted or repealed by legislatures and administrative authorities. They can also become legally binding through establishment by the courts. Many legal systems recognize that both rules and principles can be made into law or lose their status as law through precedent (Raz 1972, p. 848).

According to this view, legal principles are like legal rules in that both derive their authority under the rule of recognition from the official acts of courts and legislatures. If the Riggs principle that no person shall profit from her own wrong has legal authority, it is because that principle was either declared by a court in the course of adjudicating a dispute or formally promulgated by the appropriate legislative body.

Further, inclusive positivists argue that Dworkin's account of principles is itself consistent with the pedigree thesis. As Hart puts it, "this interpretative test seems not to be an alternative to a criterion provided by a rule of recognition, but ... only a complex 'soft-positivist' form of such a criterion identifying principles by their content not by their pedigree" (Hart 1994, p. 263). The idea, familiar from Section II, is that a rule of recognition can incorporate content-based constraints on legal validity, even those rooted ultimately in morality.

c. The Semantic Sting

In Law's Empire, Dworkin distinguishes two kinds of disagreement legal practitioners can have about the law. Lawyers can agree on the criteria a rule must satisfy to be legally valid, but disagree on whether those criteria are satisfied by a particular rule. For example, two lawyers might agree that a rule is valid if enacted by the state legislature, but disagree on whether the rule at issue was actually enacted by the state legislature. Such disagreements are empirical in nature and hence pose no theoretical difficulties for positivism.

There is, however, a second kind of disagreement that Dworkin believes is inconsistent with positivism. Lawyers often agree on the facts about a rule's creation, but disagree on whether those facts are sufficient to endow the rule with legal authority. Such disagreement is considerably deeper than empirical disagreement as it concerns the criteria for legal validity-which, according to positivism, are exhausted by the rule of recognition. Dworkin calls this second kind of disagreement theoretical disagreement about the law.

Theoretical disagreement, on Dworkin's view, is inconsistent with the pedigree thesis because the pedigree thesis explains the concept of law in terms of shared criteria for creating, changing and adjudicating law:

If legal argument is mainly or even partly about [the properties that make a proposition legally valid], then lawyers cannot all be using the same factual criteria for deciding when propositions of law are true and false. Their arguments would be mainly or partly about which criteria they should use. So the project of the semantic theories, the project of digging out shared rules from a careful study of what lawyers say and do, would be doomed to fail (Dworkin 1986, p. 43).

If lawyers disagree about the criteria of legal validity, then the grounds of legal validity cannot be exhausted by the shared criteria contained in a rule of recognition. The semantic sting, then, implies that there must be more to the concept of legal validity than can be explained by promulgation in accordance with shared criteria embodied in a rule of recognition.

The semantic sting resembles one of Dworkin's earlier criticisms of Hart's pedigree thesis. Hart believes that the rule of recognition is a social rule and is hence constituted by the conforming behavior of people who also accept the rule as a ground for criticizing deviations. Like all social rules, then, the rule of recognition has an external and internal aspect. The external aspect of the rule of recognition consists in general obedience to those rules satisfying its criteria of validity; the internal aspect is constituted by its acceptance as a public standard of official behavior. Hart believes it is this double aspect of the rule of recognition that accounts for its normativity and enables him to distinguish his theory from Austin's view of law as a system of coercive commands. For, as Hart points out, a purely coercive command can oblige, but never obligate, a person to comply (see Section I, supra).

Dworkin argues that this feature of Hart's theory commits him to the claim that there cannot be any disagreement about the content of rule of recognition:

Hart's qualification ... that the rule of recognition may be uncertain at particular points ... undermines [his theory].... If judges are in fact divided about what they must do if a subsequent Parliament tries to repeal an entrenched rule, then it is not uncertain whether any social rule [of recognition] governs that decision; on the contrary, it is certain that none does (Dworkin 1977, pp. 61-62).

On Dworkin's view, the requirements of a social rule cannot be uncertain since a social rule is constituted by acceptance and conforming behavior by most people in the relevant group: "two people whose rules differ ... cannot be appealing to the same social rule, and at least one of them cannot be appealing to any social rule at all" (Dworkin 1977, p. 55).

Jules Coleman responds that if the rule of recognition is a social rule, then Hart's view implies there must be general agreement among the officials of a legal system about what standards constitute the rule of recognition, but it does not imply there cannot be disagreement as to what those standards require in any given instance:

The controversy among judges does not arise over the content of the rule of recognition itself. It arises over which norms satisfy the standards set forth in it. The divergence in behavior among officials as exemplified in their identifying different standards as legal ones does not establish their failure to accept the same rule of recognition. On the contrary, judges accept the same truth conditions for propositions of law.... They disagree about which propositions satisfy those conditions (Coleman 1982, p. 156).

Coleman, then, distinguishes two kinds of disagreement practitioners can have about the rule of recognition: (1) disagreement about what standards constitute the rule of recognition; and (2) disagreement about what propositions satisfy those standards. On Coleman's view, Hart's analysis of social rules implies only that (1) is impossible.

Under the U.S. rule of recognition, for example, a federal statute is legally valid if and only if it has been enacted in accordance with the procedural requirements described in the body of the Constitution and is consistent with the first fourteen amendments. Since, on Hart's view, the U.S. rule of recognition is a social rule, U.S. officials must agree on the procedures the federal government must follow in enacting law, the set of sentences constituting the first fourteen amendments, and the requirement that federal enactments be consistent with those amendments.

But Hart's view of social rules does not imply there cannot be any disagreement about whether a given enactment is consistent with the first fourteen amendments. Legal practitioners can and do disagree on what Hart calls penumbral (or borderline) issues regarding the various amendments. While every competent practitioner in the U.S. would agree, for example, that torturing a person to induce a confession violates the fifth amendment right against self-incrimination, there is considerable disagreement about whether compelling a defendant to undergo a psychiatric examination for the purpose of increasing her sentence also violates that right. On Coleman's view, there is nothing in Hart's analysis of social rules that precludes such borderline disagreements about whether a practice is consistent with the Fifth Amendment.

Despite its resemblance to this earlier criticism, Dworkin's semantic sting argument takes aim at a deeper target. The semantic sting targets all so-called semantic theories of law that articulate the concept of law in terms of "shared rules ... that set out criteria that supply the word's meaning" (Dworkin 1986, p. 31). Thus, while the earlier criticism is directed at Hart's extraneous account of social rules, the semantic sting is directed at what Dworkin takes to be the very heart of positivism's theoretical core, namely, the claim that there are shared criteria that exhaust the conditions for the correct application of the concept of law.

At the root of the problem with semantic theories, on Dworkin's view, is a flawed theory of what makes disagreement possible. According to Dworkin, semantic theories mistakenly assume that meaningful disagreement is impossible unless "we all accept and follow the same criteria for deciding when our claims are sound, even if we cannot state exactly, as a philosopher might hope to do, what these criteria are" (Dworkin 1986, p. 45). On this flawed assumption, two people whose concepts of law differ cannot be disagreeing about the same thing.

Perhaps with Coleman's response to his earlier criticism in mind, Dworkin concedes that semantic theories are consistent with theoretical disagreements about borderline or penumbral cases: "people do sometimes speak at cross-purposes in the way the borderline defense describes" (Dworkin 1986, p. 41). But Dworkin denies semantic theories are consistent with theoretical disagreement about pivotal (or core) cases.  According to semantic theories, he says,

[Y]ou and I can sensibly discuss how many books I have on my shelf, for example, only if we both agree, at least roughly, about what a book is. We can disagree over borderline cases: I may call something a slim book that you would call a pamphlet. But we cannot disagree over what I called pivotal cases. If you do not count my copy of Moby-Dick as a book because in your view novels are not books, any disagreement is bound to be senseless (Dworkin 1986, p. 45).

The problem, on Dworkin's view, is that many difficult appellate cases like Riggs involve theoretical disagreement about pivotal cases:

The various judges who argued about our sample cases did not think they were defending marginal or borderline claims. Their disagreements about legislation and precedent were fundamental; their arguments showed that they disagreed not only about whether Elmer should have his inheritance, but about why any legislative act, even traffic codes and rates of taxation, impose the rights and obligations everyone agrees they do.... They disagreed about what makes a proposition of law true not just at the margin but in the core as well (Dworkin 1986, pp. 42-43).

On Dworkin's view, the judges in Riggs were not having a borderline dispute about some accepted criterion for the application of the concept of law. Rather, they were having a disagreement about the status of some putatively fundamental criterion itself: the majority believed, while the dissent denied, that courts have power to modify unambiguous legislative enactments.

Accordingly, theoretical disagreement about pivotal cases like Riggs is inconsistent with semantic theories of law, on Dworkin's view, because it shows that shared criteria do not exhaust the proper conditions for the application of the concept of law. For the majority and dissenting judges in Riggs were having a sensible disagreement about law even though it centered on a pivotal case involving the criteria of legal validity. Thus, Dworkin concludes, the concept of law cannot be explained by so-called criterial semantics.

In response, Hart denies both that his theory is a semantic theory and that it assumes such an account of what makes disagreement possible:

[N]othing in my book or in anything else I have written supports [a semantic account] of my theory. Thus, my doctrine that developed municipal legal systems contain a rule of recognition specifying the criteria for the identification of the laws which courts have to apply may be mistaken, but I nowhere base this doctrine on the mistaken idea that it is part of the meaning of the word 'law' that there should be such a rule of recognition in all legal systems, or on the even more mistaken idea that if the criteria for the identification of the grounds of law were not uncontroversially fixed, 'law' would mean different things to different people (Hart 1994, p. 246).

Instead, Hart argues that his theory of law is "a descriptive account of the distinctive features of law in general as a complex social phenomenon" (Hart 1994, p. 246). Hart presents his theory, not as an account of how people apply the concept of law, but rather as an account of what distinguishes systems of law from other systems of social rules. On Hart's view, it is the presence of a rule of recognition establishing criteria of validity that distinguishes law from other systems of social rules. Thus, according to Hart, Dworkin's criticism fails because it mischaracterizes positivism as providing a criterial explanation of the concept of law.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Austin, John, Lectures on Jurisprudence and the Philosophy of Positive Law (St. Clair Shores, MI: Scholarly Press, 1977)
  • Austin, John, The Province of Jurisprudence Determined (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995)
  • Bentham, Jeremy, Of Laws In General (London: Athlone Press, 1970)
  • Blackstone, William, Commentaries on the Law of England (Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1979)
  • Coleman, Jules, "Negative and Positive Positivism," 11 Journal of Legal Studies 139 (1982)
  • Dworkin, Ronald M., Law's Empire (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1986)
  • Dworkin, Ronald M., Taking Rights Seriously (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1977)
  • Finnis, John, Natural Law and Natural Rights (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1980)
  • Fuller, Lon L., The Morality of Law, Revised Edition (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1969)
  • Fuller, Lon L., "Positivism and Fidelity to Law--A Reply to Professor Hart," 71 Harvard Law Review 630 (1958)
  • Faber, Klaus, "Farewell to 'Legal Positivism': The Separation Thesis Unraveling," in George, Robert P., The Autonomy of Law: Essays on Legal Positivism (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1996), 119-162
  • George, Robert P., "Natural Law and Positive Law," in George, Robert P., The Autonomy of Law: Essays on Legal Positivism (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1996), 321-334
  • Hart, H.L.A., The Concept of Law, Second Edition (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994)
  • Hart, H.L.A., "American Jurisprudence through English Eyes: The Nightmare and the Noble Dream," reprinted in Hart, H.L.A., Essays in Jurisprudence and Philosophy (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1983), 123-144.
  • Hart, H.L.A., "Book Review of The Morality of Law" 78 Harvard Law Review 1281 (1965)
  • Hart, H.L.A., Essays on Bentham (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1982)
  • Hart, H.L.A., "Positivism and the Separation of Law and Morals," 71 Harvard Law Review 593 (1958)
  • Himma, Kenneth E., "Judicial Discretion and the Concept of Law," forthcoming in Oxford Journal of Legal Studies vol. 18, no. 1 (1999)
  • Mackie, J.L., "The Third Theory of Law," Philosophy & Public Affairs, vol. 7, no. 1 (Fall 1977)
  • Moore, Michael, "Law as a Functional Kind," in George, Robert P. (ed.), Natural Law Theory: Contemporary Essays (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1992), 188-242
  • Raz, Joseph, The Authority of Law: Essays on Law and Morality (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1979)
  • Raz, Joseph, "Authority, Law and Morality," The Monist, vol. 68, 295-324
  • Raz, Joseph, "Legal Principles and the Limits of Law," 81 Yale Law Review 823 (1972)
  • Raz, Joseph, "Two Views of the Nature of the Theory of Law: A Partial Comparison," Legal Theory, vol. 4, no. 3 (September 1998), 249-282
  • Waluchow, W.J., Inclusive Legal Positivism (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994)

Author Information

Kenneth Einar Himma
Seattle Pacific University
U. S. A.

Legal Pragmatism

Legal pragmatism is a theory critical of more traditional pictures of law and, more specifically, judicial decision-making. The classical view of law offers a case-based theory of law that emphasizes the universal and foundational quality of specifically legal facts, the meticulous analysis of precedent and argument from analogy. Legal pragmatism, on the other hand, emphasizes the need to include a more diverse set of data and claims that law is best thought of as a practice that is rooted in the specific context at hand, without secure foundations, instrumental, and always attached to a perspective. A pragmatic stance towards jurisprudence offers many philosophical challenges to more traditional descriptions of the legal domain.

Table of Contents

1. The Classical Picture of Judicial Decision-Making

The "classical picture" of legal argumentation and analysis dominates theoretical descriptions of judicial decision-making. It also is the dominant picture among legal practitioners. The classical model of legal argumentation is based upon the casebook method, the use of precedent and rigorous arguments from analogy. The casebook method assumes that the essential and exhaustive materials for a legal decision are summed up in the published opinions that accompany the conclusion of controversies in court. What an attorney or, more importantly, a judge is supposed to look to so as to render the proper verdict are reasons offered and situations analyzed in previous decisions that seem relevantly similar. The data for the decision is therefore the casebook. From a set of precedents, of written court opinions, is distilled a general set of rules and a specific verdict in the controversy before the court. Given a legal controversy, the practitioner (judge, attorney or the like) looks at previous cases for similar situations and then tries to distill the reasons that have been accepted as legally relevant for his or her client's position. From these sources a legal conclusion should be drawn.

This classical picture of legal argumentation is historically attributed to former Harvard Law School Dean Christopher Columbus Langdell. Langdell put the first case book together as a educational tool, and bundled this type of book with a Socratic style of teaching that reigns supreme in legal practice and education today. Both the use of the casebook and the Socratic method presuppose a somewhat insular and rationalistic view of legal institutions. One of the most influential sources of the classical model of more recent vintage is offered by Edward Levi in An Introduction to Legal Reasoning. As he describes it legal reasoning is a "three-step process" where a "similarity is seen between cases; next the rule of law inherent in the first case is announced; then the rule of law is made applicable to the second case (Levi 1949, p. 2)." The implicit assumption is that once the similarity between cases is recognized, legal reasoning is simply a matter of making a logically valid deduction of a holding from a statement of the law (major premise) and a statement of the facts (minor premise). But by far the most influential current advocate of the main elements of the classical view is Ronald Dworkin.

Dworkin's theory functions as a normative theory as well as a descriptive one. Taken as a descriptive claim the theory offers a portrait of what judges actually do when arriving at a legal conclusion. Dworkin's own version of legal decision-making is entitled "law as integrity" (Dworkin, 1986). According to this theory, consistency with past judicial decisions should be emphasized as one of the most important legal virtues. He offers the picture of an imaginary creation, the "chain-novel," to argue for the centrality of precedent in law. A chain-novel is a novel that is written one chapter at a time. After the creation of each new chapter, the novel is passed to a new author for further elaboration. Dworkin argues that in this enterprise we surely would want the new author to find as supremely important the need to cohere with and respect the content of the chapters already completed. An author that didn't follow this rule would be not properly fulfilling his or her role. Dworkin then argues the same assumptions should rule the legal world and, therefore, the judge's activity. That is, each case is directly analogous to a new chapter in the chain-novel. If one accepts the analogy, and there seems to be much too little analysis critiquing the acceptability of such an analogy, one gets a picture of a somewhat insulated legal system running upon a deep need for internal coherence. While Dworkin disavows the deductivist picture offered by Langdell, and allows in a moral dimension, in his attachment to traditional legal materials and practices he is clearly a proponent of the classical view. The legal pragmatist finds much to argue with in this picture of jurisprudence.

2. The Pragmatist's Picture of Judicial Decision-Making

Legal pragmatists such as Daniel Farber, Thomas Grey, Margaret Radin and Richard Posner think that such a picture of jurisprudence is severely flawed. The legal pragmatist thinks that the classical view is overly legalistic, naively rationalistic and based upon misunderstandings of legal institutions. As opposed to the self-imposed limitations entailed by the classical view of judicial decision-making, legal pragmatists emphasize the eclectic nature and the diverse aims of the law. More specifically, legal pragmatists largely agree upon four main aspects of a pragmatist version of jurisprudence: (1) the important of context; (2) the lack of foundations; (3) the instrumental nature of law; and (4) the unavoidable presence of alternate perspectives.

a. Contextual

For the legal pragmatist all legal controversies are essentially attached to a specific and unique context. As Posner describes it, emphasizing the unavoidable presence of a specific context "disconnects the whirring machinery of philosophical abstraction from the practical business of governing our lives and our societies (Posner 1995, p. 463)." While there is some irony in a foremost proponent of neo-classical economics critiquing "philosophical abstractions," Posner here correctly highlights the contextualist's slogan of "return from abstractions to the concrete." Certainly Dworkin and Langdell can be seen as overly fond of abstractions. In this case they mirror the actual practitioners. Tamanaha argues that the contrasting contextualism of legal pragmatism is best shown in Justice Holmes' strategy whereby he used historical analysis to expose such seemingly timeless abstract legal concepts as being actually derived from contingent and context-specific needs (Tamanaha 1996, p. 315). Through this strategy the illusion of an eternal set of essential legal concepts is exposed as actually being a contingent creation of specific conflicts. While even legal formalists expect to apply concepts to a context, the legal pragmatist differs in seeing the concepts themselves as products of context. Because of this, the assumption that the legal concepts are applicable beyond their originating controversy is questioned.

The basic claim offered by the contextualist critique is that all legal decision-making, as well as any legal controversy, takes place in a specific and unique context that is so constitutive of the issues and the ultimate decision that the decision is distorted if seen from a non-contextual perspective. More importantly, the concepts used are questionable when applied between different controversies. Because of this, the abstractionist tendencies of the classical view of legal decision-making is thought undesirable and a view that emphasizes context, such as the legal pragmatist's, to be superior.

b. Antifoundational

In addition to the need to emphasize context, the legal pragmatist also argues that the lack of foundations in legal decision-making must be recognized. Foundationalists hold that there is some core principle or principles that all legal decisions can be deduced from. While today very few will admit to an extreme view of such foundationalism, most legal theorizing assumes a more moderate foundationalist view. This moderate view argues that the judge has a sufficient set of tools from within the traditional materials of the classical view of legal decision-making (the case method) to make properly informed decisions in present cases. In other words, the moderate view sees cases as the necessary and sufficient foundation from which to deduce sufficiently analyzed legal conclusions.

A legal pragmatist sees this as descriptively wrong. First, "the idea that correct outcomes can be deduced from some overarching principle - or set of principles" is rejected (Cotter 1996, p. 2085). In place of deductive certainty is offered a picture of induction and an emphasis upon the creative problem-solving act of jurisprudence. Second, pragmatism in general stands for a rejection of the metaphysical picture of knowledge or decision-making that sees either as needing (or indeed having) a foundation. Knowledge and reason in law, as in any other domain, are seen as essentially open-ended concepts in need of continual testing and revision, and therefore law is an activity that would outgrow any purported foundations. So, if cases are thought to provide a foundation to legal decisions the legal pragmatist argues that they will not be inevitably up to the challenge of the next case, and therefore the foundationalist picture is at the very least incomplete.

c. Instrumental

While the classical view of legal decision-making emphasizes consistency with past decisions (the high value of respect for precedent), the instrumentalist advocates an investigation of the effects a decision might have and the capabilities of the legal institution. An instrumental view is therefore less interested in precedent and more based upon a "orientation towards the future (Rosenfeld 1996, p. 98)." That is, instead of an emphasis upon consistency with the essence of past decisions the pragmatist judge looks to the worldly implications of his or her decision. For instance, in a contract dispute a judge following the classical model of legal reasoning would look to antecedently held rights and obligations as shown in earlier cases in order to decide. A pragmatist judge, on the other hand, would see those issues as important but would also look at the greater implications for contract disputes in the future. This prospective attitude would bring in data as to the effects of the contract decision upon third parties, how a ruling would affect daily life, etc.

This orientation towards the future, and towards the empirical, means that for the legal pragmatist judge a whole new set of reasons become applicable and legally relevant when making a decision. While the advocate of the classical view can limit the reasons and facts to those allowed in the analogous cases, the cases accepted as precedents, the pragmatist judge must allow in other sorts of data, for instance sociological or economic data, in order to properly access the individual case at hand. Therefore, instead of emphasizing the primacy of consistency with precedent, a pragmatist of a legal bent emphasizes "the primacy of consequences in interpretation (Posner 1995, p. 252)."

d. Perspectival

Finally, the legal pragmatist adopts a stance that embraces the problem of perspective. Perspectivalism entails a suspicion of broad generalities and an acknowledgment of eclectic manners of description. As opposed to legal formalism, which "holds that determinate meanings exist in legal texts which may be discerned by reason and that objective, immutable principles simultaneously inform and transcend the practice of applying rules," perspectivism emphasizes that all is messy, open-ended, and subject to revision in light of another perspective or further information (Shutkin 1993, p. 66). The acknowledgment of perspective entails that an overly deferential stance towards precedent and previously endorsed analogies could be unfairly restrictive towards new and possibly more inclusive descriptions.

As can be seen from the above, legal pragmatism offers a significant alternative to more traditional views of the legal domain. In fact, Stuart Scheingold argues that this lack of awareness of conflicting perspectives is a pervasive quality of traditional legal thought. As he puts it "Law professors and lawyers do not believe that they are either encumbered or enlightened by a special view of the world. They simply feel that their legal training has taught them to think logically. In a complex world, they have the intellectual tools to strip a problem, any problem, down to its essentials (Scheingold 1974, p. 161)." But if such an assumption is itself just one perspective, and one that obviously would distort any appreciation of other alternative perspectives, such ignorance of their own perspective would be an important vice to identify.

But important issues remain even if one finds such a description of legal pragmatism attractive. First, is legal pragmatism offered as a descriptive or a normative picture of jurisprudence? Second, does such a stance really offer any desirable features that the more classical picture of law cannot deliver or does it suffer from more intractable flaws?

3. Legal Pragmatism as a Descriptive Theory

Legal pragmatism can be characterized as a theory with descriptive pretensions. That is, as a theory as to what really happens in law, despite the ideological prevalence of the classical model. The descriptive legal pragmatist thinks that the classical picture of jurisprudence does not fit the facts of law, and that a pragmatist picture offers a better alternative. A legal pragmatism of this type looks to the legal realists as historical precursor. The legal realists claimed that law was a much sloppier and more political, as well as less reasonable, institution than those following the Langdell model admitted. In other words, that the reasons and data offered by the classical model of legal decision-making do not properly explain the actions of legal institutions. The legal pragmatist, therefore, looks for empirical evidence that argues against such a constrained view of decision-making.

Such evidence is not too hard to come by. First, it is clear that political actors do not treat the court system as neutral and functioning only upon respect for precedent. The full-blown fights over judicial appointments shows that actors outside of the court system view judges as politically important. Second, there is much empirical research that questions the assumption that precedent actually has the authority claimed for it. Some studies have claimed that decisions are more influenced by the political beliefs of the judge than by precedent (Goldman 1979, p. 208). Another study claimed an 85% success rate in prediction of future case decisions based upon a study of the judge's "values" (Rohde/Spaeth 1976, p. 157). A further study concluded, "Supreme Court justices are not influenced by landmark precedents with which they disagree (Segal/Spaeth 1996, p. 971)." What the empirical data tends to show, then, is that the classical model does not explain the way actual judges decide cases very well.

On the other hand, the legal pragmatist model has difficulties as a descriptive theory as well. First, judges for the most part certainly act and write as if they are following precedent and the traditional legal materials. Second, it seems as if judges that were really pragmatic would have to be more rigorous in the following out of empirical implications of their decisions.

But this possibility raises many questions. For instance, would the current fear of statistics and sociological data that lawyers have as an rule have to be overcome in order for law to be actually and accurately described as pragmatic? Furthermore, there is the question of institutional competence. Does the legal system really have the resources to gather and digest all the data necessary to make an informed pragmatic decision? Does a judge have the capacity to digest all the relevant material in order to have any competent idea as to the real-world ramifications of any non-clerical decision? Would not a judge that described him or herself as a pragmatist judge be just as deluded as the judge that adopts the more traditional description?

4. Legal Pragmatism as a Normative Theory

Because neither option seems to accurately fit what really goes on in the jurisprudential domain, perhaps legal pragmatism should be better thought of as a normative theory. That is, perhaps it is a conceptual stance offered as a picture of what judicial decision-making should be.

In its normative mode legal pragmatism treats law and the legal realm as a tool useful for social purposes. The legal pragmatist opposes the a priori and rationalistic style of argumentation traditionally applied in legal argumentation by arguing that such methods have no valid claim to authority and, indeed, lack the tools necessary to justify their own adoption. The more traditional style of legal reasoning, that which keeps its attention upon cases, excludes broader and more scientifically warranted data. Therefore the user of the classical theory can offer not much more than a heart-felt and resounding exclamation - "it works" - when confronted with the question of the empirical effectiveness of a decision. All pragmatist thought brings with it a suspicion of unquestioned and non-experimental pictures of reason. Indeed the pragmatist is liable to see in such a claim something akin to the statement "because God commanded it." This "it works" exclamation is an example of just such an a priori, rationalist and non-experimental claim. What exactly does it work in comparison to? For the pragmatist such statements only have meaning if they can be tested, and the classical picture of jurisprudence doesn't have the tools with which to test such claims in each case or on a more global level.

On the other hand, adoption of a pragmatist theory offers the ideal of a system rooted in experience and the experimental method. As opposed to the overly rationalistic and insular picture of legal decision-making offered by the classical legal theorist, the legal pragmatist argues for a more empirical jurisprudence. The normative argument, in outline, is that a jurisprudential theory rooted in sensitivity to context, a theory that functions without a belief in false foundations, one that is judged along explicitly instrumental criteria and that also acknowledges the inevitability of perspective, is better suited to bring about justice in a complex and unpredictable world than a theory that rests upon untested essentialistic assumptions and a non-experimental and universalistic view of reason.

5. Selected Bibliography

Brint, Micheal and William Weaver, Pragmatism in Law and Society (Boulder: Westview Press, 1991)

Cotter, Thomas F., "Legal Pragmatism and the Law and Economics Movement," 84 Georgetown Law Journal 2071 (1996)

Dickstein, Morris, The Revival of Pragmatism: New Essays on Social Thought, Law, and Culture (Durham: Duke University Press, 1998).

Dworkin, Ronald M., Law's Empire (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1986)

Farber, Daniel, "Reinventing Brandeis: Legal Pragmatism for the Twenty-First Century," 1995 University of Illinois Law Review 163 (1995)

Goldman, Sheldon, "The Effect of Past Judicial Behavior on Subsequent Decision-Making," 19 Jurimetrics Journal 208 (1979)

Grey, Thomas G., "Freestanding Legal Pragmatism," 18 Cardozo Law Review 21 (1996)

------"Holmes and Legal Pragmatism," 41 Stanford Law Review 787 (1989)

Levi, Edward, H., An Introduction To Legal Reasoning (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1949)

MacCormick, Neil, Legal Reasoning and Legal Theory (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1978)

Posner, Richard, Overcoming Law (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1995)

------"Pragmatic Adjudication," 18 Cardozo Law Review 1 (1996)

Radin, Margaret Jane, "The Pragmatist and the Feminist," 63 Southern California Law Review 1699 (1990)

Rohde, David W., and Harold J. Spaeth, Supreme Court Decision Making (San Francisco: W.H. Freeman, 1976)

Rorty, Richard, "The Banality of Pragmatism and the Poetry of Justice," in Pragmatism in Law and Society

Rosenberg, Gerald D., The Hollow Hope: Can Courts Bring About Social Change? (Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1991).

Rosenfeld, Michel, "Pragmatism, Pulralism and Legal Interpretation: Posner's and Rorty's Justice Without Metaphysics Metts Hate Speech," 18 Cardozo Law Review 97 (1996)

Segal, Jeffrey A., and Horold J. Spaeth, "The Influence of Stare Decisis on the Votes of Supreme Court Justices," 40 American Journal of Political Science 971 (1996)

Scheingold, Stuart A., The Politics of Rights (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1974)

Shutkin, William Andrew, "Pragmatism and the Promise of Adjudication," 18 Vermont Law Review 57 (1993)

Smith, Steven D., "The Pursuit of Pragmatism," 100 Yale Law Journal 409 (1990)

Tamanaha, Brian Z., "Pragmatism in U.S. Legal Theory: Its Application to Normative Jurisprudence, Sociolegal Studies, and the Fact-Value Distinction, 41 American Journal of Jurisprudence 315 (1996)

Wells, Catharine P. "Improving One's Situation: Some Pragmatic Reflections on the Art of Judging," 49 Washington and Lee Law Review 323 (1992)

Author Information

Brian Edgar Butler
University of North Carolina at Asheville
U. S. A.

Natural Law

The term "natural law" is ambiguous. It refers to a type of moral theory, as well as to a type of legal theory, but the core claims of the two kinds of theory are logically independent. It does not refer to the laws of nature, the laws that science aims to describe. According to natural law moral theory, the moral standards that govern human behavior are, in some sense, objectively derived from the nature of human beings and the nature of the world. While being logically independent of natural law legal theory, the two theories intersect. However, the majority of the article will focus on natural law legal theory.

According to natural law legal theory, the authority of legal standards necessarily derives, at least in part, from considerations having to do with the moral merit of those standards. There are a number of different kinds of natural law legal theories, differing from each other with respect to the role that morality plays in determining the authority of legal norms. The conceptual jurisprudence of John Austin provides a set of necessary and sufficient conditions for the existence of law that distinguishes law from non-law in every possible world. Classical natural law theory such as the theory of Thomas Aquinas focuses on the overlap between natural law moral and legal theories.  Similarly, the neo-naturalism of John Finnis is a development of classical natural law theory. In contrast, the procedural naturalism of Lon L. Fuller is a rejection of the conceptual naturalist idea that there are necessary substantive moral constraints on the content of law. Lastly, Ronald Dworkin’s theory is a response and critique of legal positivism. All of these theories subscribe to one or more basic tenets of natural law legal theory and are important to its development and influence.

Table of Contents

  1. Two Kinds of Natural Law Theory
  2. Conceptual Naturalism
    1. The Project of Conceptual Jurisprudence
    2. Classical Natural Law Theory
  3. The Substantive Neo-Naturalism of John Finnis
  4. The Procedural Naturalism of Lon L. Fuller
  5. Ronald Dworkin's "Third Theory"
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Two Kinds of Natural Law Theory

At the outset, it is important to distinguish two kinds of theory that go by the name of natural law. The first is a theory of morality that is roughly characterized by the following theses. First, moral propositions have what is sometimes called objective standing in the sense that such propositions are the bearers of objective truth-value; that is, moral propositions can be objectively true or false. Though moral objectivism is sometimes equated with moral realism (see, e.g., Moore 1992, 190: "the truth of any moral proposition lies in its correspondence with a mind- and convention-independent moral reality"), the relationship between the two theories is controversial. Geoffrey Sayre-McCord (1988), for example, views moral objectivism as one species of moral realism, but not the only form; on Sayre-McCord's view, moral subjectivism and moral intersubjectivism are also forms of moral realism. Strictly speaking, then, natural law moral theory is committed only to the objectivity of moral norms.

The second thesis constituting the core of natural law moral theory is the claim that standards of morality are in some sense derived from, or entailed by, the nature of the world and the nature of human beings. St. Thomas Aquinas, for example, identifies the rational nature of human beings as that which defines moral law: "the rule and measure of human acts is the reason, which is the first principle of human acts" (Aquinas, ST I-II, Q.90, A.I). On this common view, since human beings are by nature rational beings, it is morally appropriate that they should behave in a way that conforms to their rational nature. Thus, Aquinas derives the moral law from the nature of human beings (thus, "natural law").

But there is another kind of natural law theory having to do with the relationship of morality to law. According to natural law theory of law, there is no clean division between the notion of law and the notion of morality. Though there are different versions of natural law theory, all subscribe to the thesis that there are at least some laws that depend for their "authority" not on some pre-existing human convention, but on the logical relationship in which they stand to moral standards. Otherwise put, some norms are authoritative in virtue of their moral content, even when there is no convention that makes moral merit a criterion of legal validity. The idea that the concepts of law and morality intersect in some way is called the Overlap Thesis.

As an empirical matter, many natural law moral theorists are also natural law legal theorists, but the two theories, strictly speaking, are logically independent. One can deny natural law theory of law but hold a natural law theory of morality. John Austin, the most influential of the early legal positivists, for example, denied the Overlap Thesis but held something that resembles a natural law ethical theory.

Indeed, Austin explicitly endorsed the view that it is not necessarily true that the legal validity of a norm depends on whether its content conforms to morality. But while Austin thus denied the Overlap Thesis, he accepted an objectivist moral theory; indeed, Austin inherited his utilitarianism almost wholesale from J.S. Mill and Jeremy Bentham. Here it is worth noting that utilitarians sometimes seem to suggest that they derive their utilitarianism from certain facts about human nature; as Bentham once wrote, "nature has placed mankind under the governance of two sovereign masters, pain and pleasure. It is for them alone to point out what we ought to do, as well as to determine what we shall do. On the one hand the standard of right and wrong, on the other the chain of causes and effects, are fastened to their throne" (Bentham 1948, 1). Thus, a commitment to natural law theory of morality is consistent with the denial of natural law theory of law.

Conversely, one could, though this would be unusual, accept a natural law theory of law without holding a natural law theory of morality. One could, for example, hold that the conceptual point of law is, in part, to reproduce the demands of morality, but also hold a form of ethical subjectivism (or relativism). On this peculiar view, the conceptual point of law would be to enforce those standards that are morally valid in virtue of cultural consensus. For this reason, natural law theory of law is logically independent of natural law theory of morality. The remainder of this essay will be exclusively concerned with natural law theories of law.

2. Conceptual Naturalism

a. The Project of Conceptual Jurisprudence

The principal objective of conceptual (or analytic) jurisprudence has traditionally been to provide an account of what distinguishes law as a system of norms from other systems of norms, such as ethical norms. As John Austin describes the project, conceptual jurisprudence seeks "the essence or nature which is common to all laws that are properly so called" (Austin 1995, 11). Accordingly, the task of conceptual jurisprudence is to provide a set of necessary and sufficient conditions for the existence of law that distinguishes law from non-law in every possible world.

While this task is usually interpreted as an attempt to analyze the concepts of law and legal system, there is some confusion as to both the value and character of conceptual analysis in philosophy of law. As Brian Leiter (1998) points out, philosophy of law is one of the few philosophical disciplines that takes conceptual analysis as its principal concern; most other areas in philosophy have taken a naturalistic turn, incorporating the tools and methods of the sciences. To clarify the role of conceptual analysis in law, Brian Bix (1995) distinguishes a number of different purposes that can be served by conceptual claims: (1) to track linguistic usage; (2) to stipulate meanings; (3) to explain what is important or essential about a class of objects; and (4) to establish an evaluative test for the concept-word. Bix takes conceptual analysis in law to be primarily concerned with (3) and (4).

In any event, conceptual analysis of law remains an important, if controversial, project in contemporary legal theory. Conceptual theories of law have traditionally been characterized in terms of their posture towards the Overlap Thesis. Thus, conceptual theories of law have traditionally been divided into two main categories: those like natural law legal theory that affirm there is a conceptual relation between law and morality and those like legal positivism that deny such a relation.

b. Classical Natural Law Theory

All forms of natural law theory subscribe to the Overlap Thesis, which asserts that there is some kind of non-conventional relation between law and morality. According to this view, then, the notion of law cannot be fully articulated without some reference to moral notions. Though the Overlap Thesis may seem unambiguous, there are a number of different ways in which it can be interpreted.

The strongest construction of the Overlap Thesis forms the foundation for the classical naturalism of Aquinas and Blackstone. Aquinas distinguishes four kinds of law: (1) eternal law; (2) natural law; (3) human law; and (4) divine law. Eternal law is comprised of those laws that govern the nature of an eternal universe; as Susan Dimock (1999, 22) puts it, one can "think of eternal law as comprising all those scientific (physical, chemical, biological, psychological, etc.) 'laws' by which the universe is ordered." Divine law is concerned with those standards that must be satisfied by a human being to achieve eternal salvation. One cannot discover divine law by natural reason alone; the precepts of divine law are disclosed only through divine revelation.

The natural law is comprised of those precepts of the eternal law that govern the behavior of beings possessing reason and free will. The first precept of the natural law, according to Aquinas, is the somewhat vacuous imperative to do good and avoid evil. Here it is worth noting that Aquinas holds a natural law theory of morality: what is good and evil, according to Aquinas, is derived from the rational nature of human beings. Good and evil are thus both objective and universal.

But Aquinas is also a natural law legal theorist. On his view, a human law (that is, that which is promulgated by human beings) is valid only insofar as its content conforms to the content of the natural law; as Aquinas puts the point: "[E]very human law has just so much of the nature of law as is derived from the law of nature. But if in any point it deflects from the law of nature, it is no longer a law but a perversion of law" (ST I-II, Q.95, A.II). To paraphrase Augustine's famous remark, an unjust law is really no law at all.

The idea that a norm that does not conform to the natural law cannot be legally valid is the defining thesis of conceptual naturalism. As William Blackstone describes the thesis, "This law of nature, being co-eval with mankind and dictated by God himself, is of course superior in obligation to any other. It is binding over all the globe, in all countries, and at all times: no human laws are of any validity, if contrary to this; and such of them as are valid derive all their force, and all their authority, mediately or immediately, from this original" (1979, 41). In this passage, Blackstone articulates the two claims that constitute the theoretical core of conceptual naturalism: 1) there can be no legally valid standards that conflict with the natural law; and 2) all valid laws derive what force and authority they have from the natural law.

It should be noted that classical naturalism is consistent with allowing a substantial role to human beings in the manufacture of law. While the classical naturalist seems committed to the claim that the law necessarily incorporates all moral principles, this claim does not imply that the law is exhausted by the set of moral principles. There will still be coordination problems (e.g., which side of the road to drive on) that can be resolved in any number of ways consistent with the set of moral principles. Thus, the classical naturalist does not deny that human beings have considerable discretion in creating natural law. Rather she claims only that such discretion is necessarily limited by moral norms: legal norms that are promulgated by human beings are valid only if they are consistent with morality.

Critics of conceptual naturalism have raised a number of objections to this view. First, it has often been pointed out that, contra Augustine, unjust laws are all-too- frequently enforced against persons. As Austin petulantly put the point:

Now, to say that human laws which conflict with the Divine law are not binding, that is to say, are not laws, is to talk stark nonsense. The most pernicious laws, and therefore those which are most opposed to the will of God, have been and are continually enforced as laws by judicial tribunals. Suppose an act innocuous, or positively beneficial, be prohibited by the sovereign under the penalty of death; if I commit this act, I shall be tried and condemned, and if I object to the sentence, that it is contrary to the law of God, who has commanded that human lawgivers shall not prohibit acts which have no evil consequences, the Court of Justice will demonstrate the inconclusiveness of my reasoning by hanging me up, in pursuance of the law of which I have impugned the validity (Austin 1995, 158).

Of course, as Brian Bix (1999) points out, the argument does little work for Austin because it is always possible for a court to enforce a law against a person that does not satisfy Austin's own theory of legal validity.

Another frequently expressed worry is that conceptual naturalism undermines the possibility of moral criticism of the law; inasmuch as conformity with natural law is a necessary condition for legal validity, all valid law is, by definition, morally just. Thus, on this line of reasoning, the legal validity of a norm necessarily entails its moral justice. As Jules Coleman and Jeffrey Murphy (1990, 18) put the point:

The important things [conceptual naturalism] supposedly allows us to do (e.g., morally evaluate the law and determine our moral obligations with respect to the law) are actually rendered more difficult by its collapse of the distinction between morality and law. If we really want to think about the law from the moral point of view, it may obscure the task if we see law and morality as essentially linked in some way. Moral criticism and reform of law may be aided by an initial moral skepticism about the law.

There are a couple of problems with this line of objection. First, conceptual naturalism does not foreclose criticism of those norms that are being enforced by a society as law. Insofar as it can plausibly be claimed that the content of a norm being enforced by society as law does not conform to the natural law, this is a legitimate ground of moral criticism: given that the norm being enforced by law is unjust, it follows, according to conceptual naturalism, that it is not legally valid. Thus, the state commits wrong by enforcing that norm against private citizens.

Second, and more importantly, this line of objection seeks to criticize a conceptual theory of law by pointing to its practical implications ñ a strategy that seems to commit a category mistake. Conceptual jurisprudence assumes the existence of a core of social practices (constituting law) that requires a conceptual explanation. The project motivating conceptual jurisprudence, then, is to articulate the concept of law in a way that accounts for these pre-existing social practices. A conceptual theory of law can legitimately be criticized for its failure to adequately account for the pre-existing data, as it were; but it cannot legitimately be criticized for either its normative quality or its practical implications.

A more interesting line of argument has recently been taken up by Brian Bix (1996). Following John Finnis (1980), Bix rejects the interpretation of Aquinas and Blackstone as conceptual naturalists, arguing instead that the claim that an unjust law is not a law should not be taken literally:

A more reasonable interpretation of statements like "an unjust law is no law at all" is that unjust laws are not laws "in the fullest sense." As we might say of some professional, who had the necessary degrees and credentials, but seemed nonetheless to lack the necessary ability or judgment: "she's no lawyer" or "he's no doctor." This only indicates that we do not think that the title in this case carries with it all the implications it usually does. Similarly, to say that an unjust law is "not really law" may only be to point out that it does not carry the same moral force or offer the same reasons for action as laws consistent with "higher law" (Bix 1996, 226).

Thus, Bix construes Aquinas and Blackstone as having views more similar to the neo- naturalism of John Finnis discussed below in Section III. Nevertheless, while a plausible case can be made in favor of Bix's view, the long history of construing Aquinas and Blackstone as conceptual naturalists, along with its pedagogical value in developing other theories of law, ensures that this practice is likely, for better or worse, to continue indefinitely.

3. The Substantive Neo-Naturalism of John Finnis

John Finnis takes himself to be explicating and developing the views of Aquinas and Blackstone. Like Bix, Finnis believes that the naturalism of Aquinas and Blackstone should not be construed as a conceptual account of the existence conditions for law. According to Finnis, the classical naturalists were not concerned with giving a conceptual account of legal validity; rather they were concerned with explaining the moral force of law: "the principles of natural law explain the obligatory force (in the fullest sense of 'obligation') of positive laws, even when those laws cannot be deduced from those principles" (Finnis 1980, 23-24). On Finnis's view of the Overlap Thesis, the essential function of law is to provide a justification for state coercion (a view he shares with Ronald Dworkin). Accordingly, an unjust law can be legally valid, but it cannot provide an adequate justification for use of the state coercive power and is hence not obligatory in the fullest sense; thus, an unjust law fails to realize the moral ideals implicit in the concept of law. An unjust law, on this view, is legally binding, but is not fully law.

Like classical naturalism, Finnis's naturalism is both an ethical theory and a theory of law. Finnis distinguishes a number of equally valuable basic goods: life, health, knowledge, play, friendship, religion, and aesthetic experience. Each of these goods, according to Finnis, has intrinsic value in the sense that it should, given human nature, be valued for its own sake and not merely for the sake of some other good it can assist in bringing about. Moreover, each of these goods is universal in the sense that it governs all human cultures at all times. The point of moral principles, on this view, is to give ethical structure to the pursuit of these basic goods; moral principles enable us to select among competing goods and to define what a human being can permissibly do in pursuit of a basic good.

On Finnis's view, the conceptual point of law is to facilitate the common good by providing authoritative rules that solve coordination problems that arise in connection with the common pursuit of these basic goods. Thus, Finnis sums up his theory of law as follows:

[T]he term 'law' ... refer[s] primarily to rules made, in accordance with regulative legal rules, by a determinate and effective authority (itself identified and, standardly, constituted as an institution by legal rules) for a 'complete' community, and buttressed by sanctions in accordance with the rule-guided stipulations of adjudicative institutions, this ensemble of rules and institutions being directed to reasonably resolving any of the community's co-ordination problems (and to ratifying, tolerating, regulating, or overriding co-ordination solutions from any other institutions or sources of norms) for the common good of that community (Finnis 1980, 276).

Again, it bears emphasizing that Finnis takes care to deny that there is any necessary moral test for legal validity: "one would simply be misunderstanding my conception of the nature and purpose of explanatory definitions of theoretical concepts if one supposed that my definition 'ruled out as non-laws' laws which failed to meet, or meet fully, one or other of the elements of the definition" (Finnis 1980, 278).

Nevertheless, Finnis believes that to the extent that a norm fails to satisfy these conditions, it likewise fails to fully manifest the nature of law and thereby fails to fully obligate the citizen-subject of the law. Unjust laws may obligate in a technical legal sense, on Finnis's view, but they may fail to provide moral reasons for action of the sort that it is the point of legal authority to provide. Thus, Finnis argues that "a ruler's use of authority is radically defective if he exploits his opportunities by making stipulations intended by him not for the common good but for his own or his friends' or party's or faction's advantage, or out of malice against some person or group" (Finnis 1980, 352). For the ultimate basis of a ruler's moral authority, on this view, "is the fact that he has the opportunity, and thus the responsibility, of furthering the common good by stipulating solutions to a community's co- ordination problems" (Finnis 1980, 351).

Finnis's theory is certainly more plausible as a theory of law than the traditional interpretation of classical naturalism, but such plausibility comes, for better or worse, at the expense of naturalism's identity as a distinct theory of law. Indeed, it appears that Finnis's natural law theory is compatible with naturalism's historical adversary, legal positivism, inasmuch as Finnis's view is compatible with a source-based theory of legal validity; laws that are technically valid in virtue of source but unjust do not, according to Finnis, fully obligate the citizen. Indeed, Finnis (1996) believes that Aquinas's classical naturalism fully affirms the notion that human laws are "posited."

4. The Procedural Naturalism of Lon L. Fuller

Like Finnis, Lon Fuller (1964) rejects the conceptual naturalist idea that there are necessary substantive moral constraints on the content of law. But Fuller, unlike Finnis, believes that law is necessarily subject to a procedural morality. On Fuller's view, human activity is necessarily goal-oriented or purposive in the sense that people engage in a particular activity because it helps them to achieve some end. Insofar as human activity is essentially purposive, according to Fuller, particular human activities can be understood only in terms that make reference to their purposes and ends. Thus, since lawmaking is essentially purposive activity, it can be understood only in terms that explicitly acknowledge its essential values and purposes:

The only formula that might be called a definition of law offered in these writings is by now thoroughly familiar: law is the enterprise of subjecting human conduct to the governance of rules. Unlike most modern theories of law, this view treats law as an activity and regards a legal system as the product of a sustained purposive effort (Fuller 1964, 106).

To the extent that a definition of law can be given, then, it must include the idea that law's essential function is to "achiev[e] [social] order through subjecting people's conduct to the guidance of general rules by which they may themselves orient their behavior" (Fuller 1965, 657).

Fuller's functionalist conception of law implies that nothing can count as law unless it is capable of performing law's essential function of guiding behavior. And to be capable of performing this function, a system of rules must satisfy the following principles:

  • (P1) the rules must be expressed in general terms;
  • (P2) the rules must be publicly promulgated;
  • (P3) the rules must be prospective in effect;
  • (P4) the rules must be expressed in understandable terms;
  • (P5) the rules must be consistent with one another;
  • (P6) the rules must not require conduct beyond the powers of the affected parties;
  • (P7) the rules must not be changed so frequently that the subject cannot rely on them; and
  • (P8) the rules must be administered in a manner consistent with their wording.

On Fuller's view, no system of rules that fails minimally to satisfy these principles of legality can achieve law's essential purpose of achieving social order through the use of rules that guide behavior. A system of rules that fails to satisfy (P2) or (P4), for example, cannot guide behavior because people will not be able to determine what the rules require. Accordingly, Fuller concludes that his eight principles are "internal" to law in the sense that they are built into the existence conditions for law.

These internal principles constitute a morality, according to Fuller, because law necessarily has positive moral value in two respects: (1) law conduces to a state of social order and (2) does so by respecting human autonomy because rules guide behavior. Since no system of rules can achieve these morally valuable objectives without minimally complying with the principles of legality, it follows, on Fuller's view, that they constitute a morality. Since these moral principles are built into the existence conditions for law, they are internal and hence represent a conceptual connection between law and morality. Thus, like the classical naturalists and unlike Finnis, Fuller subscribes to the strongest form of the Overlap Thesis, which makes him a conceptual naturalist.

Nevertheless, Fuller's conceptual naturalism is fundamentally different from that of classical naturalism. First, Fuller rejects the classical naturalist view that there are necessary moral constraints on the content of law, holding instead that there are necessary moral constraints on the procedural mechanisms by which law is made and administered: "What I have called the internal morality of law is ... a procedural version of natural law ... [in the sense that it is] concerned, not with the substantive aims of legal rules, but with the ways in which a system of rules for governing human conduct must be constructed and administered if it is to be efficacious and at the same time remain what it purports to be" (Fuller 1964, 96- 97).

Second, Fuller identifies the conceptual connection between law and morality at a higher level of abstraction than the classical naturalists. The classical naturalists view morality as providing substantive constraints on the content of individual laws; an unjust norm, on this view, is conceptually disqualified from being legally valid. In contrast, Fuller views morality as providing a constraint on the existence of a legal system: "A total failure in any one of these eight directions does not simply result in a bad system of law; it results in something that is not properly called a legal system at all" (Fuller 1964, 39).

Fuller's procedural naturalism is vulnerable to a number of objections. H.L.A. Hart, for example, denies Fuller's claim that the principles of legality constitute an internal morality; according to Hart, Fuller confuses the notions of morality and efficacy:

[T]he author's insistence on classifying these principles of legality as a "morality" is a source of confusion both for him and his readers.... [T]he crucial objection to the designation of these principles of good legal craftsmanship as morality, in spite of the qualification "inner," is that it perpetrates a confusion between two notions that it is vital to hold apart: the notions of purposive activity and morality. Poisoning is no doubt a purposive activity, and reflections on its purpose may show that it has its internal principles. ("Avoid poisons however lethal if they cause the victim to vomit"....) But to call these principles of the poisoner's art "the morality of poisoning" would simply blur the distinction between the notion of efficiency for a purpose and those final judgments about activities and purposes with which morality in its various forms is concerned (Hart 1965, 1285-86).

On Hart's view, all actions, including virtuous acts like lawmaking and impermissible acts like poisoning, have their own internal standards of efficacy. But insofar as such standards of efficacy conflict with morality, as they do in the case of poisoning, it follows that they are distinct from moral standards. Thus, while Hart concedes that something like Fuller's eight principles are built into the existence conditions for law, he concludes they do not constitute a conceptual connection between law and morality.

Unfortunately, Hart overlooks the fact that most of Fuller's eight principles double as moral ideals of fairness. For example, public promulgation in understandable terms may be a necessary condition for efficacy, but it is also a moral ideal; it is morally objectionable for a state to enforce rules that have not been publicly promulgated in terms reasonably calculated to give notice of what is required. Similarly, we take it for granted that it is wrong for a state to enact retroactive rules, inconsistent rules, and rules that require what is impossible. Poisoning may have its internal standards of efficacy, but such standards are distinguishable from the principles of legality in that they conflict with moral ideals.

Nevertheless, Fuller's principles operate internally, not as moral ideals, but merely as principles of efficacy. As Fuller would likely acknowledge, the existence of a legal system is consistent with considerable divergence from the principles of legality. Legal standards, for example, are necessarily promulgated in general terms that inevitably give rise to problems of vagueness. And officials all too often fail to administer the laws in a fair and even-handed manner even in the best of legal systems. These divergences may always be prima facie objectionable, but they are inconsistent with a legal system only when they render a legal system incapable of performing its essential function of guiding behavior. Insofar as these principles are built into the existence conditions for law, it is because they operate as efficacy conditions and not because they function as moral ideals.

5. Ronald Dworkin's "Third Theory"

Ronald Dworkin's so-called third theory of law is best understood as a response to legal positivism, which is essentially constituted by three theoretical commitments: the Social Fact Thesis, the Conventionality Thesis, and the Separability Thesis. The Social Fact Thesis asserts it is a necessary truth that legal validity is ultimately a function of certain kinds of social facts; the idea here is that what ultimately explains the validity of a law is the presence of certain social facts, especially formal promulgation by a legislature.

The Conventionality Thesis emphasizes law's conventional nature, claiming that the social facts giving rise to legal validity are authoritative in virtue of a social convention. On this view, the criteria that determine whether or not any given norm counts as a legal norm are binding because of an implicit or explicit agreement among officials. Thus, for example, the U.S. Constitution is authoritative in virtue of the conventional fact that it was formally ratified by all fifty states.

The Separability Thesis, at the most general level, simply denies naturalism's Overlap Thesis; according to the Separability Thesis, there is no conceptual overlap between the notions of law and morality. As Hart more narrowly construes it, the Separability Thesis is "just the simple contention that it is in no sense a necessary truth that laws reproduce or satisfy certain demands of morality, though in fact they have often done so" (Hart 1994, 185-186).

Dworkin rejects positivism's Social Fact Thesis on the ground that there are some legal standards the authority of which cannot be explained in terms of social facts. In deciding hard cases, for example, judges often invoke moral principles that Dworkin believes do not derive their legal authority from the social criteria of legality contained in a rule of recognition (Dworkin 1977, p. 40).

In Riggs v. Palmer, for example, the court considered the question of whether a murderer could take under the will of his victim. At the time the case was decided, neither the statutes nor the case law governing wills expressly prohibited a murderer from taking under his victim's will. Despite this, the court declined to award the defendant his gift under the will on the ground that it would be wrong to allow him to profit from such a grievous wrong. On Dworkin's view, the court decided the case by citing "the principle that no man may profit from his own wrong as a background standard against which to read the statute of wills and in this way justified a new interpretation of that statute" (Dworkin 1977, 29).

On Dworkin's view, the Riggs court was not just reaching beyond the law to extralegal standards when it considered this principle. For the Riggs judges would "rightfully" have been criticized had they failed to consider this principle; if it were merely an extralegal standard, there would be no rightful grounds to criticize a failure to consider it (Dworkin 1977, 35). Accordingly, Dworkin concludes that the best explanation for the propriety of such criticism is that principles are part of the law.

Further, Dworkin maintains that the legal authority of standards like the Riggs principle cannot derive from promulgation in accordance with purely formal requirements: "[e]ven though principles draw support from the official acts of legal institutions, they do not have a simple or direct enough connection with these acts to frame that connection in terms of criteria specified by some ultimate master rule of recognition" (Dworkin 1977, 41).

On Dworkin's view, the legal authority of the Riggs principle can be explained wholly in terms of its content. The Riggs principle was binding, in part, because it is a requirement of fundamental fairness that figures into the best moral justification for a society's legal practices considered as a whole. A moral principle is legally authoritative, according to Dworkin, insofar as it maximally conduces to the best moral justification for a society's legal practices considered as a whole.

Dworkin believes that a legal principle maximally contributes to such a justification if and only if it satisfies two conditions: (1) the principle coheres with existing legal materials; and (2) the principle is the most morally attractive standard that satisfies (1). The correct legal principle is the one that makes the law the moral best it can be. Accordingly, on Dworkin's view, adjudication is and should be interpretive:

[J]udges should decide hard cases by interpreting the political structure of their community in the following, perhaps special way: by trying to find the best justification they can find, in principles of political morality, for the structure as a whole, from the most profound constitutional rules and arrangements to the details of, for example, the private law of tort or contract (Dworkin 1982, 165).

There are, thus, two elements of a successful interpretation. First, since an interpretation is successful insofar as it justifies the particular practices of a particular society, the interpretation must fit with those practices in the sense that it coheres with existing legal materials defining the practices. Second, since an interpretation provides a moral justification for those practices, it must present them in the best possible moral light.

For this reason, Dworkin argues that a judge should strive to interpret a case in roughly the following way:

A thoughtful judge might establish for himself, for example, a rough "threshold" of fit which any interpretation of data must meet in order to be "acceptable" on the dimension of fit, and then suppose that if more than one interpretation of some part of the law meets this threshold, the choice among these should be made, not through further and more precise comparisons between the two along that dimension, but by choosing the interpretation which is "substantively" better, that is, which better promotes the political ideals he thinks correct (Dworkin 1982, 171).

As Dworkin conceives it, then, the judge must approach judicial decision-making as something that resembles an exercise in moral philosophy. Thus, for example, the judge must decide cases on the basis of those moral principles that "figure[] in the soundest theory of law that can be provided as a justification for the explicit substantive and institutional rules of the jurisdiction in question" (Dworkin 1977, 66).

And this is a process, according to Dworkin, that "must carry the lawyer very deep into political and moral theory." Indeed, in later writings, Dworkin goes so far as to claim, somewhat implausibly, that "any judge's opinion is itself a piece of legal philosophy, even when the philosophy is hidden and the visible argument is dominated by citation and lists of facts" (Dworkin 1986, 90).

Dworkin believes his theory of judicial obligation is a consequence of what he calls the Rights Thesis, according to which judicial decisions always enforce pre-existing rights: "even when no settled rule disposes of the case, one party may nevertheless have a right to win. It remains the judge's duty, even in hard cases, to discover what the rights of the parties are, not to invent new rights retrospectively" (Dworkin 1977, 81).

In "Hard Cases," Dworkin distinguishes between two kinds of legal argument. Arguments of policy "justify a political decision by showing that the decision advances or protects some collective goal of the community as a whole" (Dworkin 1977, 82). In contrast, arguments of principle "justify a political decision by showing that the decision respects or secures some individual or group right" (Dworkin 1977, 82).

On Dworkin's view, while the legislature may legitimately enact laws that are justified by arguments of policy, courts may not pursue such arguments in deciding cases. For a consequentialist argument of policy can never provide an adequate justification for deciding in favor of one party's claim of right and against another party's claim of right. An appeal to a pre-existing right, according to Dworkin, can ultimately be justified only by an argument of principle. Thus, insofar as judicial decisions necessarily adjudicate claims of right, they must ultimately be based on the moral principles that figure into the best justification of the legal practices considered as a whole.

Notice that Dworkin's views on legal principles and judicial obligation are inconsistent with all three of legal positivism's core commitments. Each contradicts the Conventionality Thesis insofar as judges are bound to interpret posited law in light of unposited moral principles. Each contradicts the Social Fact Thesis because these moral principles count as part of a community's law regardless of whether they have been formally promulgated. Most importantly, Dworkin's view contradicts the Separability Thesis in that it seems to imply that some norms are necessarily valid in virtue of their moral content. It is his denial of the Separability Thesis that places Dworkin in the naturalist camp.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Thomas Aquinas, On Law, Morality and Politics (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co., 1988)
  • John Austin, Lectures on Jurisprudence and the Philosophy of Positive Law (St. Clair Shores, MI: Scholarly Press, 1977)
  • John Austin, The Province of Jurisprudence Determined (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995)
  • Jeremy Bentham, A Fragment of Government (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988)
  • Jeremy Bentham, Of Laws In General (London: Athlone Press, 1970) Jeremy Bentham, The Principles of Morals and Legislation (New York: Hafner Press, 1948)
  • Brian Bix, "On Description and Legal Reasoning," in Linda Meyer (ed.), Rules and Reasoning (Oxford: Hart Publishing, 1999)
  • Brian Bix, Jurisprudence: Theory and Context (Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 1996) Brian Bix, "Natural Law Theory," in Dennis M. Patterson (ed.), A Companion to Philosophy of Law and Legal Theory (Cambridge: Blackwell Publishing Co., 1996)
  • William Blackstone, Commentaries on the Law of England (Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1979)
  • Jules L. Coleman, "On the Relationship Between Law and Morality," Ratio Juris, vol. 2, no. 1 (1989), 66-78
  • Jules L. Coleman, "Negative and Positive Positivism," 11 Journal of Legal Studies 139 (1982)
  • Jules L. Coleman and Jeffrie Murphy, Philosophy of Law (Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 1990)
  • Ronald M. Dworkin, Law's Empire (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1986)
  • Ronald M. Dworkin, Taking Rights Seriously (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1977)
  • John Finnis, Natural Law and Natural Rights (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1980)
  • John Finnis, "The Truth in Legal Positivism," in Robert P. George, The Autonomy of Law (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1996), 195-214
  • Lon L. Fuller, The Morality of Law, Revised Edition (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1964)
  • Lon L. Fuller, "A Reply to Professors Cohen and Dworkin", 10 Villanova Law Review 655 (1965), 657. Lon L. Fuller, "Positivism and Fidelity to Law--A Reply to Professor Hart," 71 Harvard Law Review 630 (1958)
  • Klaus F¸þer, "Farewell to 'Legal Positivism': The Separation Thesis Unravelling," in George, The Autonomy of Law, 119-162
  • Robert P. George, "Natural Law and Positive Law," in George, The Autonomy of Law, 321-334
  • Robert P. George, Natural Law Theory: Contemporary Essays (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1992)
  • H.L.A. Hart, The Concept of Law, Second Edition (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994)
  • H.L.A. Hart, "Book Review of The Morality of Law" 78 Harvard Law Review 1281 (1965) H.L.A. Hart, Essays on Bentham (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1982) H.L.A. Hart, "Positivism and the Separation of Law and Morals," 71 Harvard Law Review 593 (1958)
  • Kenneth Einar Himma, "Positivism, Naturalism, and the Obligation to Obey Law," Southern Journal of Philosophy, vol. 36, no. 2 (Summer 1999)
  • Kenneth Einar Himma, "Functionalism and Legal Theory: The Hart/Fuller Debate Revisited," De Philosophia, vol. 14, no. 2 (Fall/Winter 1998)
  • J.L. Mackie, "The Third Theory of Law," Philosophy & Public Affairs, Vol. 7, No. 1 (Fall 1977)
  • Michael Moore, "Law as a Functional Kind," in George, Natural Law Theory, 188- 242
  • Joseph Raz, The Authority of Law: Essays on Law and Morality (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1979)
  • Joseph Raz, "Authority, Law and Morality," The Monist, vol. 68, 295-324 Joseph Raz, "Legal Principles and the Limits of Law," 81 Yale Law Review 823 (1972)
  • Geoffrey Sayre-McCord, "The Many Moral Realisms," in Sayre-McCord (ed.), Essays on Moral Realism (Ithica: Cornell University Press, 1988)

Author Information

Kenneth Einar Himma
Seattle Pacific University
U. S. A.

The Right to Private Property

The right to private property is the social-political principle that adult human beings may not be prohibited or prevented by anyone from acquiring, holding and trading (with willing parties) valued items not already owned by others. Such a right is, thus, unalienable and, if in fact justified, is supposed to enjoy respect and legal protection in a just human community.

Table of Contents

  1. Why Private Property?
  2. Individuality and Humanity
  3. Individualism: True and False
  4. Individuality and Privacy
  5. Classical Liberalism, Human Nature & Individuality
  6. Fluctuating Classes
  7. The Moral Standing of Private Property Rights
  8. Individualism and Historicism
  9. Individualist Alternative to Organicism
  10. The Appeal of Collectivism
  11. The Right to Private Property
  12. No Carte Blanche to Communities
  13. Property Rights, Individuality and the Moral Life
  14. No Private Property Rights, No Full Moral Agency
  15. Moral Individualism
  16. The Virtue of Prudence
  17. Prudence and Justice
  18. Moral Responsibility and Private Property
  19. Naturalism and Politics
  20. Commerce and Property
  21. Moral Standing of Political-Economic Systems
  22. Morality and Public Affairs
  23. Law and Common Sense
  24. Abandon the Divided Self Idea
  25. End Notes

1. Why Private Property?

The right to private property(1) is the social-political principle that adult human beings may not be prohibited or prevented by anyone from acquiring, holding and trading (with willing parties) valued items not already owned by others. Such a right is, thus, unalienable and, if in fact justified, is supposed to enjoy respect and legal protection in a just human community.

In the development of classical liberalism there emerged in Western political thought a shift of focus as to the prime value in social-political matters, from the group--a tribe, class, state or nation--to the human individual. It started with the effort to gradually transfer power from a few or even one person as the source of collective authority and power to more segments of society involved in exercising such authority and power, leading, eventually, to the sovereignty of the human individual. The way in which power is diffused when individuals are sovereigns rather than groups is through the fact that individuals have only a little and highly diversified power to wield. In consequences, they aren't likely to impose themselves on others by, say, starting a war, even when they disagree very seriously. That, in essence, was the initial motivation for moving toward individualism, which, when implemented via law and public policy, is much more conducive to peace and, as a result, to prosperity than is any form of collectivism. Thus classical liberalism has had some considerable support on practical grounds--its usefulness to attaining various widely sought after objectives.

A major reason, however, that individualism makes better sense than its competitors is that the view that human beings are primarily parts of a social whole is wrong. This last is a false notion. When invoked, arguably it tends to serve as a disguise for certain special or vested privileges of some members of society.(2) Generalizing such special or vested interests, the values or goals pursued in their name, has been a major source of political acrimony throughout human history. It even continues to drive much of contemporary democratic politics.

There is, however, the problem that as far as its ethical presuppositions and implications are concerned, individualism and in consequences also classical liberalism have not fared all that well. These views are constantly being charged with opposition to community life and human fellowship, hedonism, materialism, and so forth. Even though this is wrongheaded, without a solid moral case it is difficult to show that to be true. The reason is that morality is extremely important in human affairs. Most people do not confidently embrace a political stance unless it manages to embrace certain basic moral principles. Pragmatic reasons thus never suffice to establish the soundness of political systems and public policies.

It is part of the point of this essay to show that private property rights accord with certain basic moral principles. These are the indispensability of human agency in any sensible moral framework and the moral virtue of prudence. I will argue that individualism embraces these principles and that the right to private property makes their actual realization possible in human community life.

2. Individuality and Humanity

Human beings have, as one of their distinctive features, a significant element of individuality. Notice, for example, how this comes through in some thought experiments. If a friend dies, it is nonsense to think, "Oh well, I'll just get another friend." You cannot just replace a person with another if you regard him as he really is, most basically, not just as some member of a class of people, such as dentists or auto mechanics. (Even with pets it's difficult to replace them because they become sort of humanized around us.)

On the other hand, with a cow, fly, rock and most other things in the world, replacing them is no problem in one sense because they aren't important individually. They're important in their relationship to other things, whereas in the case of human beings it is everyone's individuality that matters most, especially in those most significant personal or intimate relationships. You fall in love with an individual, not a banker--when you really fall in love, that is. (Some people "fall in love" with a type, true enough, but there's something perverse about that -- it is somewhat sad to hear, "Well, I love him because he's in uniform or has a big car.")

Even apart from such common sense observations there is the clear evidence that whenever we consider human beings, we cannot avoid their volitional conduct, actions they choose to bring about on their own.(3) In intellectual discussions this is evident in the fact that we criticize one another about what we think, holding our adversaries directly or indirectly responsible for alleged misjudgments.(4)

It is a reasonable view, then, that human beings are first and foremost individuals who cause much of what they do. Their actions flow from their thinking and their thinking is the sphere in which they are free, self-determined.(5)

3. Individualism: True and False

Now individualism is associated somewhat uncomfortably with classical liberalism. The reason is that some have overemphasized the element of individuality, making it seem that we are not also members of communities, even of the human race. Such "atomistic" individualism has made it seem that classical liberalism is tied to a misguided social philosophy. An example of it may be found in the oft repeated story, by economists, of Robinson Crusoe. If one models human life on Crusoe's story and his interaction with Friday, it appears that we are born capable of self-sufficient productive conduct and from the start choose whether to associated with others. Yet this idea is patently absurd, considering that all human beings are born helpless and grow up in the company of others on whose support they vitally depend.

Yet it is not true that individualism is necessarily committed to atomism. One can fully admit to the communal aspects of human life while insisting that we are essentially individuals, as well. Such a robust, what I have called "classical" individualism, also stresses the importance of the private realm and insists that all bona fide human communities must adhere to the terms individuals set for themselves.

The crucial individualist ingredient of classical liberal social and political theory stresses not some arid independence or isolation of the individual human being but the fact that everyone can make what in principle can be independent judgments as to the kind of communities suitable to one's membership. Given human nature, the element of choice must be preserved in every suitable human community. This is the source of the classical liberal political principles that demands that the consent of the governed be upheld in public policy as well as personal relations. The criminal nature of murder, assault, kidnapping, rape, robbery, burglary and so forth all make sense in terms of this classical or moderate individualism first found in Aristotle philosophy.(6)

4. Individuality and Privacy

The gist of individualism is, then, that everyone must consent to being used by another. This is because each is important, valuable in his or her own right. And if an individual is important as such, then there is a sphere that constitutes the individual's realm of sovereignty and others ought to respect it, the realm within which one must make effective judgments about one's life. And indeed in classical liberal, political, and legal theory there's a great deal of emphasis on individual rights rather than rights of families or other groups, bearing on this individualist element of the position. The right to private property is, in turn, the most practically relevant of those individual rights.

The term "privacy," then, underlines this emphasis of the importance of individuals. The right to private property is really just an extension, within the framework of a naturalist world view, of the right to one's own life. It is when one('s life) engages with the rest of the world in the unique way one will do so, and when another will do this in his or her unique way, then privacy becomes important.(7) It will then be possible to actualize and to protect who one is and one's manifestation in the world--one's own art, productivity, creativity, innovation and so forth. None of those, as well, may be used by others without the individual's consent to whom they belong.

Socialism and Humanity

Now consider that one of the interesting things about socialism is that in deep-seeded socialist theory there are no individuals. Marx said it directly: "The human essence is the true collectivity of man."(8) He also noted that human beings constitute specie-beings and comprise "an organic whole" in the collectivity we call humanity.(9) What is important about you and me for a consistent, thoroughgoing socialist is that we belong to the human race, somewhat analogously to the way a bee belongs to its hive or an ant to its colony, only in this case the constituent parts are intelligent persons.

This is especially true of international socialism, but National Socialism and even more restrictive, local forms of socialism, emphasize the group as a whole and its plan, telos or destiny. Even communitarians, as vague as their conception of a community comes to (so that one cannot pin them down as socialists because they leave room for some elements of individualism), speak mostly of concerns in behalf of "us" and use the term "we" to designate the primarily valued party when discussing public policy. The individual can then, at times, be sacrificed if some gains are made for the group, collective or community.

5. Classical Liberalism, Human Nature & Individuality

Yet, if we examine human life carefully, we notice clearly that there is something irreducibly, inescapably, individual about everybody. Just think about yourself. How do you insist on being regarded by friends and others close to you? As a student? An American or Rumanian or Hispanic? Or as a woman or basketball player? Is there not in fact something unique that is the you that captures who you are? One's identity isn't racial, ethnic, religious or even professional. It is individual. As John Quincy Adams said in the motion picture Amistad, ask not what someone is but who someone is to come to know the person.

It's in classical liberalism that this is acknowledged more than in any other political philosophy. There's always been a little bit of emphasis on individuality, of course, in various rebellious political movements, but it's very difficult to maintain the supremacy of the tribe or, later, the state if one admits that what is truly important in a human society is the individuals who comprise it, as individuals. Because then one can't reasonably say, "Well, we can do away with that individual or with that group of individuals or their projects so as to benefit some others, including some collective such as the state, community, culture or race."

Indeed, with the recognition and acknowledgment of the supreme value of the individual, the very definition of a "good" or "just" society would have to emphasize the freedom and happiness of individuals.

In fact, a characteristic of the classical liberal political ethos is that one scrutinizes a society for its quality, its goodness, and its justice on the basis of how loyal it is to the mission of securing the rights of individuals to their liberty and pursuit of happiness. This is actually a very prominent movement in the world today. It's not done consistently and purely, but all those human rights organizations that go from country to country to check whether they adhere to tenets of justice are at least rhetorically committed to the examination of whether the countries treat their citizens as individuals with rights. Are their projects respected or are they neglected and treated with callous disregard for the choices of individuals?

This is one of the reasons that in a largely liberal--or, for the sake of avoiding confusion with American liberalism, a libertarian--society membership in a class looses its moral and political significance. In the United States of American, for example there are matters that may make no difference to most people, but when they matter to even just one, it is appreciated. I, for one, once worked as a busboy in Cleveland, Ohio, and noticed that when paid, I could go back to the same restaurant and eat a meal there. There was no frowning and shaking of the head and saying, "Wait a minute, you don't belong here." In much of Europe, in contrast, if you work in a restaurant you don't get to eat there--it is not illegal now but it's certainly gosh.

6. Fluctuating Classes

In a more or less libertarian social-political society the divisions that are based on incidental attributes--one's wealth, color, national origin, ethnicity, race, and so forth--tend to be less significant because one's individual worth trumps all these and classes, at any rate, are always in a flux. Even racial and ethnic, not to mention religious or economic categories tend to shift because there is no widespread and well entrenched legally enforced barriers to either entry to or exit from any of them.

Such categories and the behavior associated with them may still prevail in certain special contexts. For example, a professor will usually attain special respect in the classroom, but when one meets the professor at a restaurant, one will not need to carry over the behavior associated with that classroom status. No "Herr Doktor," as, for example, in much of Germany, in or outside the classroom. In most American schools, however, one says, "Hello Professor," but outside the label isn't usually used.

All this can be a bit disturbing because it can sometimes spill over into disrespect for people who in fact deserve respect. Rampant individualism can corrupt into disrespect for all authority. The corruption can but by no means need be generated by the notion that individuals matter primarily as individuals, not so much as members of classes. It is also evident enough that we are social beings, members of the class of human beings, and there are some matters very important about that, too.

7. The Moral Standing of Private Property Rights

Individualism does, however, underlie the regime of private property rights. But why do we need a separate discussion of the merits of the right to private property? What will such an inquiry yield?

There are at least two answers to that question. One is that when you resist people taking something from you, by taxation, theft or any other means, it is important to know, even if only implicitly, that the resistance is justified. That it is a kind of self-defense, akin to resisting someone assaulting or raping someone else. It is vital to learn that one is in the right and is not doing something merely willful or stubborn or prejudicial, that one is not just being a recalcitrant, antisocial person, when one insists on the integrity of ownership. This is a point widely contested by opponents of classical liberal or libertarian legal orders.

When all things are considered, the most important questions about liberalism and its various tenets is, "Is it true?" "Is classical liberalism or, its purest versions, libertarianism, the way a society ought to be organized?" And, in order to answer that question, one must examine whether its various tenets can withstand challenges, criticisms and so on. Individualism is one of these tenets but the right to private property is the most important practical, public policy element of it.

The second reason we need to examine private property rights is whether system of individual rights, including the right to private property, is a just system? Or is it, as many critics claim, just a figment of some people's imagination?

One of the most prominent and oft-repeated criticisms leveled at classical liberalism, especially by students of various configurations of Marxism--there are about 300 versions now--is that this whole emphasis on individuality is a kind of a historical glitch. It's only a temporary phase in history which had its role but now can be dispensed with.

8. Individualism and Historicism

The Marxists and many others, some who follow them without knowing it, claim that in the 16th century the individual was invented, not merely discovered or his existence politically affirmed, for the sake of sustaining economic productivity. In order to create motivation for wealth-creation, the individual had to be made seem significant. It's a myth, but it's a useful myth. It's like telling someone that she is beautiful when she isn't so that she will do certain things from which certain advantages derive. According to Marxists, there was a period of human history where the belief in the importance of the individual had an objective historical function, not because it's true, but because it contributes to certain crucial elements of capitalism.

There are people who look at history in this way, as if it is the record of the growth of humanity from infancy to full maturity. They then take it that the bourgeois epoch is like the adolescence of an individual. It's a temporary stage and has its usefulness because, typically, adolescents embark upon all sorts of useless ventures--such as getting up at four o'clock to drive some place not because there's something important to do as a sort of exercise to prepare for adulthood. It trains them for the eventual serious challenges of maturity.

When one treats humanity this way, so that it has these various historical stages, individualism can be regarded to be one of those stages. It's a somewhat appealing picture--it fits some images we have of humankind. Ecologists encourage this, as do some moral visionaries who see humanity as a big family or some other kind of collectivity.

Marx explicitly said that the Greek era was the childhood of humanity. He, as I have noted already, and many of those who have been influenced by his thinking believe that humanity is some kind of organism, a being of which individuals are the parts. Humanity goes through stages of organic development, the tribalism its first and communism its final stage. And while the individualist stage in a necessary one, it is certainly not the completed stage of humanity.

9. Individualist Alternative to Organicism

These challenges have to be answered because they are extremely well developed, plausible enough, and with enormous influence in the world intellectual community. It is a little like when one meets a friend and asks them to explain some event such as their recent divorce and they proceed to give you a very well worked out and sincerely held rationalization as to how things happened. Now, in order to cope with one of these rationalizations, one must get to the heart of the actual situation and demonstrate beyond all reasonable doubt that the story is a different one. One must show that one's understanding of what's going on is more rational, coherent, comprehensive, and explains much more than does theirs. Otherwise the deceptive story will be the only viable account making the rounds, despite its conflict with common sense.

Unless liberalism is able to identify a better story than what those who champion the organic view advance, it will be defeated, at least theoretically. And while that isn't always decisive, it certainly has an impact on the confidence with which the position can be supported and implemented.

Indeed, one of the advantages of anti-liberal doctrines is that so many intellectuals are enchanted by them. They create elaborate and smart stories around them, stories that are extremely appealing and intellectually challenging. For one, such a story gives the intellectual a privileged position. Only intellectuals are in the position to grasp such a complex story, after all. Common sense does not support it. (For example, Marx thought only communists could really understand the truth of such a story, the rest of us having been blinded by our class outlook.)

10. The Appeal of Collectivism

The idea, for example, that we are all mere parts of a large human organism, humanity, has very a strong intellectual standing in our time. A great many people make reference to humanity--as when they talk about sacrificing oneself or one's private interests or one's materialistic goals for humanity. And others refer to smaller groups--the community or ethnic group or the race--as the organisms that are of significance.

So it's almost a feature of the mainstream to think of us not as individuals but as parts of some larger whole. "Don't you have something more important to live for than yourself?" "Isn't there something greater than yourself to which your life must be devoted for it to be worthwhile?" Less loosely, some, such as the philosopher Charles Taylor, argue that we all must belong to a group, by dint of our very humanity, our nature as human beings. He tells us that "Theories which assert the primacy of rights are those which take as the fundamental, or at least a fundamental, principle of their political theory the ascription of certain rights to individuals which deny the same status to a principle of belonging or obligation, that is a principle which states our obligation as men to belong to or sustain society, or a society of a certain type, or to obey authority or an authority of a certain type."(10) Never mind that Taylor cannot give us any such theories--John Locke, for example, rested basic human rights on ethics or natural law. What is important in what Taylor says is not only that if you just live to make the most of your life, you're not really living a significant enough life. A significant life must not only fulfill a greater purpose and humanity's purpose is one of the candidates. God's purpose is another candidate. Ecologists have a biological purpose in mind. But a significant life but belong to the effort to pursue this purpose and thus our lives, to be properly significant, may be subordinated, by force, to such purposes.(11)

There's a very prominent tradition of selecting alternative wholes larger than ourselves as the proposed beneficiaries of significant human actions. And this can lead to the whole process of forcing individuals to be used for purposes to which they do not consent. This is the greatest source of coercive thinking in human history. Once it is accepted that human individuals are part of a larger whole they, as members of a partnership or team, have enforceable obligations to the goals of that large whole. They belong to it.

Consider, to appreciate this, how in certain cases we treat such wholes as ourselves. If something happens to one's ear, for example, and yet one prizes one's appearance with an intact ear, then one takes another part of one's body that's not visible and takes part of it so as to replace the ear. The famous Welsh actor, Richard Harris, had his nose destroyed in a fight, so doctors took a part of his hip bone and replaced it, clearly because the nose was more important to an actor than that little part of the hip bone.

Well, if humanity is the larger organism, then maybe a given individual may not be so important a part of it as another. So the less important individual can be sacrificed for the more important one (or the goals of the less important can be sacrificed for those of the more important). One may be an eye and the other just a useless thumb. That picture is widely embraced because of the belief that humanity is some organic whole.

If one recognizes collectivism as a misguided picture of human life, one must carefully and effectively argue in response to these well worked out and often honestly and sincerely meant doctrines. One must demonstrate that it is indeed individuals who count for the most in the human picture. It needs to be proven, some of the widespread opinion to the contrary notwithstanding, that notions such as "individual rights" are universal and not stuck to some limited historical epoch.

11. The Right to Private Property

One reason that it must be shown that the social regulative principle of a right to private property is sound and that it ought to be respected and protected in human community life is that it is a vital conceptual or logical implication of the individualist story. If individualism is indeed sound, so is the principle of private property rights. When the right to private property is not respected and not sufficiently protected, then there is something wrong with a community.

This means that it is not quite fit for human inhabitation, given the individuality of every person and how respect for this is a precondition for his or her flourishing.

There are many different ways in which private property has been supported in the history of political economy. Most prominent has been the claim that there should be legal protection of the right private property because this facilitates productivity--a point that's in agreement with Marx, only universalized beyond a given epoch. Protecting this right helps society get rich--not only in the 16th century but always. Both Adam Smith and John Stuart Mill tended to argue along these lines: It's a good thing to have these rights because if we act in terms of them we will have greater prosperity. Many economists today argue a similar point. Indeed, that is one reason many governments engage in privatization, so as to encourage economic growth.

All of this is vital but it isn't what is most important. What needs to be shown is that the individual has these rights regardless of what's done when simply exercising them. Even if individuals waste away their lives, they have that right. It is theirs to waste away, not someone else's, because they are the important element of society, not some outsider, not some other being such as society, the community, the tribe or the ethnic group. It is this element of liberty, the right to choose how one lives, that is most central to human community life, even if, indeed because, as a matter of one's personal life it is equally important to make the right choice, to choose to do the right thing.

That is exactly why the right to private property is vital. When effectively protected, it secures for human individuals a sphere of personal jurisdiction, the right to acquire and hold the props, as it where, with which to order one's life. Moral virtues such as generosity, kindness, courage, moderation, prudence and the rest are all imperatives the practice of which engage one with the natural world. If one is not in charge of some of that world, at least oneself, one cannot conduct oneself virtuously. So the right to one's life, liberty and property are necessary conditions for a morally significant or meaningful life in human communities.

It needs to be noted here, as a significant aside, that even if we are essentially individuals, this doesn't mean we are not also naturally members of societies. But, as moral agents and as candidates for membership in some human communities or societies, we are morally responsible to take into consideration and never neglect the fact that we must judge those societies as to whether they do adequate justice to our individuality, most generally, and whether they best serve our flourishing.

12. No Carte Blanche to Communities

From this it follows that we must always keep in focus the question of whether we ought to live in a given community. Do we--ought we to--want to support this kind of public policy, this kind of a legal system? What is the standard by which we make that kind of decision when we have the chance? At the most basic level of community concern must lie the issue of what principles should govern human communities. The right to private property is one of those principles.

Very often we don't have a direct practical option to act on the choice we make about basic principles. But at least we can think about them so that when we do get a chance to make a significant decision, then we will know where to stand. We owe it to ourselves, to a life of integrity, not to forget about that issue, ever. That is the highest duty of citizenship!

13. Property Rights, Individuality and the Moral Life

So what does the right to private property do in connection with the essential human element of individuality?

Well, as already suggested, the right to private property secures for one a sphere of sovereignty. See, if we are individuals, required, morally, to lead our lives by our judgements, it is crucial that we control the elements with which our lives are lived. Indeed, it becomes the most crucial thing.

The question, "How ought I to live?" becomes the foremost question to which you then seek an answer. While we aren't moral theoreticians and ethical philosophers and so on, that question still is always near the forefront of our minds. No matter what you do, even reading these lines, the question will arise: "Should I sleep or should I pay attention? Should I consider this point or should I just glide over it?"

All of those are questions having to do with your ethical agency, with one's governance of one's life, with one's sovereignty. One's feeling that one is doing the right thing becomes crucial if one is indeed the master of one's existence.

14. No Private Property Rights, No Full Moral Agency

Now, without the right to private property, without having some props, some elements of reality that are under our jurisdiction, our ethical decisions cannot be effectual. Consider for example, if it turns out to be true that a good human being ought to be generous. Well, if we do not have the right to private property how are we going to be generous? Are we going to be like politicians and bureaucrats and expropriate what belongs to others and give this to the poor and needy? That's not generosity. That's theft.

In short, then, in order to have a effective life of moral virtue, for example the virtue of generosity, we must have the right to property, to hold and then to be free to part with values, on your own terms.

15. Moral Individualism

Although collectivism has some currency, especially among intellectuals and social theorists, so does a particular version of individualism. I have in mind the sort that pertains to moral responsibility.

Few people ever quite let go of the idea that some things they and others do are good and some bad things and that those doing them are responsible. When others judge our lives, or when we reflect upon ours, we say, "I did or didn't do the right thing." Moreover, we can go on to consider what we did with what belongs to us--use it well or badly.

Without our sphere of sovereignty, that's manifest in the actual world where we live our lives, we would not be able to act on most moral principles, especially those that involve allocating resources. Are we stingy? But one has to be stingy with something. If one is a neat person, one has to be neat within some sphere that one keeps orderly. If a slob, one will need something that belongs to one that one isn't taking good care of. If those items don't belong to you, if you always have to ask permission of society or the clan or the tribe of the nation as to what to do with these things, the you are not the effective agents in the disposition of them. And you are then not an effective moral agent either. You cannot take pride in what you achieve, nor feel guilt for your failings. You are basically just a little bit of a cell in this larger organism.

16. The Virtue of Prudence

Prudence is one of the virtues identified in classical Greece. I want now to discuss it in a little more detail than thus far.

First, in the modern era prudence has been demeaned because the task of taking care of oneself and one's own has been deemed to be instinctual ever since Thomas Hobbes argued that we are all driven to preserve ourselves. But Hobbes rested his case on extrapolating the principles of classical mechanistic physics to human life, a move that is not at all justified. Human beings must choose their conduct, including whether they will serve others' or their own well-being. Prudence, as the ancients saw it, is the virtue one needs to take decent care of oneself.

Later Immanuel Kant argued that since prudence is a motivation that is aligned to one's own interest or inclinations, it is not a moral virtue. Only motives that are totally indifferent as to one's own interest or inclinations can have moral significance, even though we can not know whether we are ever so purely motivated.

Neither Hobbes nor Kant had it right. Prudence is a moral virtue, though not the only or highest on. In any case, a prudent person acts, among other ways, economically. Such a person realizes that one must reserve for the future, put resources away for a rainy day. Such a person isn't reckless in the disposition of the resources over which he or she has control.

But now if we have no right to acquire or hold things then we can't be prudent. We then don't have the decision-making authority to allocate resources in accordance with standards of prudence. On the other hand, if we do have this authority, then we can choose to act prudently.

17. Prudence and Justice

If in fact it is a moral virtue to be prudent, but it's politically impossible for one to act on that virtue, then there is a basic conflict between ethics and politics. Then the political sphere is not properly adjusted to the ethical sphere. Then our ethical agency has not been done sufficient justice by the legal system in which we act.

And, indeed, that is one of the things that is so frustrating in societies where one does not have the right to private property. Not only that one is going to be thwarted in one's efforts to acquire life's necessities, but that one cannot act responsibly. Here what happens is a version of the tragedy of commons.

The tragedy of commons is a problem usually associated with managing the environment. The reason is that most spheres where there are environmental problems are public. The atmosphere, oceans, rivers, large forests and so on are spheres wherein no one is individually responsible. To put it another way, everyone is responsible for the management of such spheres but no one has a clear idea what to do about this responsibility because the limits imposed by private property rights are missing.

When you have a distinct or definite sphere of jurisdiction, however complicated it may be--with various layers of responsibility and delegation--then when something is done wrong, it can be traced to the agent or agents who did it. And when things are done right, again it can be traced to the agent or agents whose responsibility it was to do them right. Without the right to private property this is impossible.

This is one of the reasons that no society can completely abolish private property. It is impossible to act in any sort of responsible way without some sphere of personal jurisdiction.

18. Moral Responsibility and Private Property

So the right to private property is the concrete manifestation of the possibility of responsible conduct in a community where there are lots of people who need to know what they ought to do and with what they ought to do it. We are talking about a life lived within the context of the natural world. If our bodies are non-existent and we are just living in an illusionary material world, then these matters are of no significance. There is an assumption underlying the right to private property, and indeed many other elements of classical liberalism or libertarianism, namely, that we have a task to live properly in the midst of a natural environment, a natural world. We are not just living a purely immaterial life. Food needs to be grown and distributed, production has to occur. All sorts of concrete, natural tasks need to be carried out in order to facilitate our human lives.

If this natural life turns out to be either illusionary or insignificant, then some of these things loose their importance. Then politics might indeed be subject to different principles, ones that facilitate different goals, different aims from prosperity, flourishing, or other kinds of earthly success. It's not easy to imagine what that would be. Yet, in a philosophical discussion of these issues, one has to contend with the fact that there are alternative basic ideas that are proposed concerning the basic elements of human living. Liberalism has to stand the test of being compared with these alternative pictures.

19. Naturalism and Politics

The naturalist approach, in the sense we are preparing and forging ways of living within the natural world, is, I am convinced, demonstrably sound. The alternatives tend to be very vaguely and confusedly supported.

There are doctrines in the world that say that all individuality, for example, is a myth. There are Eastern religions that contend that the natural, individual self is an illusion and that in truth, we're all just part of the universal consciousness.

In order to test this, one has to have some criteria by which truth needs to be determined. The naturalist approach rests on the application of criteria that are universally accessible, available to all human beings with their rational faculties intact.

20. Commerce and Property

Private property rights, of course, makes for the institution of commerce. If you trade goods and services, if you sell them, if you produce them, if you hoard them, if you save them, you have to have some level of jurisdiction over them. If I wanted to trade you my watch for your shirt, then it has to be my watch. Or I have to have delegated to me the authority of someone whose watch it is. And it has to be your shirt; otherwise there would be no ability or justification in engaging in this trade. I can't sell you this; this belongs to this hotel. But if it belongs to nobody, then I can't even ask the permission of the hotel whether I can sell it or even give it away. So commerce, as well as charity and generosity presuppose the institution of private property rights. Without that institution, these activities cannot be undertaken smoothly, without confusion.

21. Moral Standing of Political-Economic Systems

One of the questions that arises in the discussion of political philosophy and political economy is whether they have moral standing. When the Left criticizes classical liberals morally because the liberal or libertarian polity makes profit-making possible, what is the answer?

It's not enough to just say, "Well, we just like to make profit." A murderer can just say, "We just like to kill people." That is no justification, clearly.

There are those who argue that a social science such as economics requires nothing from morality--indeed, it is entirely amoral, purely positive or descriptive in its central thrust. But this is a mistake. All human affairs, including economic ones, are permeated with moral issues. In economics, for example, there is the moral (or as Rasmussen and Den Uyl have called it, the meta-normative(12)) element of private property rights.

If one does not own anything, no trade can ensue and all the talk of supply and demand must be abandoned in favor of what collectivists tend to support, a sort of share-and-share alike "economy." But to own something means to be in a distinctively normative relationship with others. They are prohibited from taking what belongs to one. They ought not do so and will be penalized, furthermore, if they do.

So the amoral stance on the market economy is doomed to failure. What is needed is a moral or other normative justification of the institution of private property rights.(13)

To do that we must analyze human nature as it is manifest in the natural world. Will such an analysis support the institutions of freedom and free markets and give them a stronger moral standing in human society than alternative ones possess?

22. Morality and Public Affairs

Now there are some who would dismiss all this because there are cases in human community affairs involving innocent helpless persons, one's who meet with natural disaster and may find themselves without any voluntary help when they need it. And that is certain a possibility, even if not a likelihood in a free society. James Sterba, for example, has been arguing for decades that because such cases are possible, the people who find themselves in them have a right to welfare that the legal order may protect. These positive rights, whereby others are required to work for such persons--or part with goods they have worked for in order to support them--come about because it would not be reasonable, Sterba argues, to demand that such people respect private property rights. It would be more reasonable to expect of them to strive to obtain the goods they need--ones Sterba calls, in a question-begging fashion, surplus wealth. (As if someone is justified in identifying what constitutes surplus--a term from classical Marxism that makes no sense outside the Marxist framework.)

If one recognizes, however, that an individual's life is his or her own and he or she does not belong to anything or anyone outside of memberships to which he or she consents, then even the most dire needs of others does not support any institutional arrangement that fails to recognize individual rights--to life, liberty, and, yes, property (that one comes by without violating the rights of others even if one does not strictly deserve the property for some kind of service rendered or other achievement--for instance, come by because others want to purchase some talent or other attribute one naturally has). Just as it is unjustified to use others as a shield against natural danger, regardless of how little use one may make of them, one may not use others against their will, including wealth they own. One must find ways around this prohibition, as indeed most do when they engage in trade rather than theft in the effort to acquire their own wealth.

It is reasonable to demand this of everyone, even those in dire straits. If, however, in desperate circumstances such people do not honor this prohibition, there can be some measure of forgiveness, even within the purview of the legal authority (as per some cases that have been subject to unusual judicial discretion). But such exceptions, as hard cases in general, make bad general law.

23. Law and Common Sense

Let me go back to where we started. When somebody robs another who resists, the latter has a common sense idea of doing the right thing, that the resistance is not merely some immature, capricious and willful conduct. It is not as if one were simply engaged in feet stomping and crying, "I want it! I want it! I want it!" No, one senses that there is right on one's side, not just an arbitrary wish and desire.

That is one reason it is vital to consider whether the free system can be given justification. What has been said here is by no means a thorough defense of the right to private property, but it does furnish some hints as to how such a defense would have to be presented if the issue ever arises, which is quite often in our world. First, this right, if protected, preserves one's moral agency in this natural world in which community life occurs. Furthermore, it punctuates the fact that striving to prosper is a morally valid goal for human beings. So, the moral virtue of prudence, of taking the requisite actions to care for oneself and one's intimates, supports the right to private property as well.

One thing that respect and protection of private property rights makes possible is the pursuit of wealth. Oddly, however, that is a criticism many offer against the system of free market capitalism that is built on the legal infrastructure of private property rights. They say, as we have already seen Marx do so, that private property rights--if they are protected, maintained, developed as law--encourage a hedonistic, narrowly selfish life, one that is concerned exclusively with acquisition of worldly goods. As he said, "the right of man to property is the ? right of selfishness." Freedom is supposed to make too much self-indulgence, including pleasure, possible.

So another question that arises here turns out to be, "Is pleasure justified?" For even if the right to private property could be used for purposes quite different from obtaining pleasure in life, if pleasure is something loathsome and this right somehow encourages its relentless pursuit, perhaps it is an institution that is much more harmful than benign.

We cannot enter this topic at length but this much should suffice for now. If we are indeed natural beings in this world, one of our important values will be pleasure, the good feelings we experience via our bodies. This is so even if there are higher goods the attainment of which may require giving up some pleasure.

So, now, if wealth brings with it the possibility of pleasure, then wealth itself is a worthy good, provided it is not stolen but created, produced, and that it is not chosen as the highest good if a higher one can also be identified.

24. Abandon the Divided Self Idea

If one has a completely different view of human nature, whereby only the spiritual side of human life is of significance, then one will embrace a different system of values and probably also champion different institutions. We have a powerful tradition in most civilizations whereby there is an uneasiness about facilitating the flourishing of the human body. And that is often what stands, at a most basic level, against the free society!

One reason underlying that stand is the lack of a clear, unambiguous and benign acceptance of our earthly selves. We often think ourselves to be so unique, so extraordinary that we believe we must be partly divine or otherworldly. St. Augustine said it well when he cried out, "How great, my God, is this force of memory, how exceedingly great! It is like a vast and boundless subterranean shrine....Yet this is a faculty of my mind and belongs to my nature; nor can I myself grasp all that I am. Therefore the mind is not large enough to contain itself. But where can that uncontained part of it be?"(14) And he then answered, as have millions of others, that it must be somewhere apart from nature.

Business, too, has a bad reputation because of this, as well as the free market place, because if our natural selves are somehow inferior, than servicing it with the vigor with which people in business do must be misguided. People who pursue profit or material wealth, would then be pursuing trivia. They would be mere hedonists. As the title of one of my articles put it, "Praise Mother Teresa and then Hit the Shopping Malls." In other words, we live a schizophrenic life. We embrace the value of prosperity, economic success, wealth on the one hand but then we deny it on the other.

Yet, if in our lives we embrace our bodies, minds, emotions, sensations and so on, then we suggest by this that a more integrated view of how to live and how to protect our values is right, not one that tears us into warring pieces.

The private property rights system rests, in part, on such an integrated understanding of human life, not the schizophrenic one. It rejects the idea that each human being is divided, a view that much of our literature embraces. It places us squarely on this earth, even though it is by no means hostile to anyone who chooses to look elsewhere for fulfillment, quite the contrary. (Indeed, the right to private property has made religious pursuits extremely fruitful as well as abundant, especially in the United States of America where churches can purchase their own land and welcome parishioners where they will not be disrupted by their foes.

The divided self idea started with Plato, at least with a certain reading of him, where he takes our minds to be divided from our bodies and where the mind is supposed to hold the rest of ourselves in check, rule it firmly. Major writers, especially theologians, have ever since stressed this drama and it is reflected in our society's institutions. Victor Hugo made note of this point:

On the day when Christianity said to man: You are a duality, you are composed of two beings, one perishable, the other immortal, one carnal, the other ethereal, one enchained by appetites, needs, and passions, the other lofted on wings of enthusiasm and reverie, the former bending forever to earth, its mother, the latter soaring always toward heaven, its fatherland--on that day, the drama was created. Is it anything other, in fact, than this contrast on every day, this battle at every moment, between two opposing principles that are ever-present in life and that contend over man from the cradle to the grave?(15)

As a result of this, sadly, we are often apologetic for pursuing a satisfactory, happy life here on earth. And then we find it difficult if not impossible to defend the political regime that most clearly enhances such a life, having to accept it when others maintain that, well, it is a mundane, materialist life that such a regime supports.

All of this must be seriously rethought. Without it the best socioeconomic system human beings have ever identified will fail to flourish.

25. End Notes

1. Randy Barnett prefers the term "the right to several property" in The Structure of Liberty (London: Oxford University Press, 1998). One reason that it is useful, at least in the context of political philosophy and moral theory, to keep with the terminology of "the right to private property" is that this right is tied to an important element of classic liberal social and political thought, namely, individualism.

2. This is what public choice theory, within contemporary political economy, has helped identify. See, however, Harold Kincaid Philosophical Foundations of the Social Sciences: Analyzing Controversies in Social Research (London: Cambridge University Press, 1996), in which the author argues that the individualist stance in modern economics is mistaken and that we ought to deploy a more holistic approach. Kincaid and many other critics of what they dub "liberal individualism" claim that individualism is atomistic. While some may, certainly not all individualist fit this description. Nor is that the only version of individualism that gives rise to liberal politics. A good case in point is John Locke, among the early liberals, and many others such as Ayn Rand, Eric Mack, Douglas B. Rasmussen, Douglas J. Den Uyl, Fred D. Miller, Jr., and the late David L. Norton, in our own age.

3. Exceptions are individuals crucially incapacitated. Political theory and law are not devices for dealing with exceptions, however.

4. I develop much of this throughout Tibor R. Machan, Classical Individualism, The Supreme Importance of Each Human Being (London: Routledge, 1998), especially in Chapter 13. "Individualism and Political Dialogue." Any kind of professional, including scholarly and intellectual, malpractice alleged in the course of political or other disputes implicitly rests responsibility with the interlocutors, blaming or commanding them for what they ought to or ought not to have done or said.

5. For more on this, see Edward Pols, Acts of Our Being (Boston, MA: University of Massachusetts Press, 1982) and Tibor R. Machan, Initiative: Human Agency and Society (Stanford, CA: Hoover Institution Press, 2000).

6. "To [Aristotle] the Individual is the primary reality, and has the first claim to recognition. In his metaphysics individual things are regarded, not as the mere shadows of the idea, but as independent realities; universal conceptions not as independent substances but as the expression for the common peculiarity of a number of individuals. Similarly in his moral philosophy he transfers the ultimate end of human action and social institutions from the State to the individual, and looks for its attainment in his free self-development. The highest aim of the State consists in the happiness of its citizens."6. Eduard Zeller, Aristotle and the Earlier Peripatetics, trans. B. F. C. Costelloe and J. H. Muirhead (London: Oxford University Press, 1897), pp. 224-26. This idea is developed further in Fred D. Miller, Jr., Nature, Justice, and Rights in Aristotle's Politics (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995). The difference between the atomistic and classical type of individualism is discussed in Tibor R. Machan, Capitalism and Individualism, Reframing the Argument for the Free Society (New York: St. Martin's Press, 1990).

7.A very important beginning had been made on this line of analysis by William of Ockham who regarded property rights as securing "the power of rights reason," that is, a sphere of personal jurisdiction that made reasoning about what one ought to do possible. This was extended more elaborate in John Locke's idea that one has the right to one's person and estate, something that, if protected, makes choice among other persons possible. An even greater advance on the precise identification of the nature of private property had been made in James Sadowsky, "Private Property and Collective Ownership," in Tibor R. Machan, The Libertarian Alternative (Chicago: Nelson Hall, 1974). Karl Marx, too, got it nearly right when he wrote that "the right of man to property is the right to enjoy his possessions and dispose of the same arbitrarily without regard for other men, independently, from society, the right of selfishness." Karl Marx, "On The Jewish Question," in Robert C. Trucker, ed., The Marx-Engels Reader (New York: W. W. Norton, 1978), p. 26. Only, Marx's warped view of human nature prompted him to consider only the most wasteful and pointless way the right to private property might be exercised.

8. Karl Marx, Selected Writings, ed., D. McLellan (London: Oxford University Press, 1977), p. 126.

9. Karl Marx, Grundrisse, trans. D. McLennan (New York: Harper Torchbooks, 1971), p. 39.

10. Charles Taylor, Philosophy and the Human Sciences (London: Cambridge University Press, 1985), p. 188.

11. The concept "belong" can be used to refer to membership as well as to being a part of. Membership in human communities embarking on various purposes can be voluntary but being a part of is something ontologically pregnant ? one is part of something sometimes whether one likes it or not. Taylor seems clearly to mean by "belong" "being part of," so that one can be compelled to adhere to the purpose at hand.

12. Douglas B. Rasmussen and Douglas J. Den Uyl, Liberty and Nature (Chicago, IL: Open Court Publishing Co., Inc., 1990).

13. For more on this, see Tibor R. Machan, "The Normative Basis of Economic Science," Economic Affairs,Vol. 18 (June 1998), pp. 43-46.

14. Augustine, Confessions, Lib. X, chap. 17. 8ff

15. Victor Hugo, La preface de Cromwell, Maurice A. Souriau, ed. (Geneve: Slatkine Reprints, 1973).

Author Information

Tibor Machan
Chapman University
U. S. A.