Category Archives: Value Theory

Empathy and Sympathy in Ethics

The distinction between “empathy” and “sympathy” in the context of ethics is a dynamic and challenging one. The eighteenth century texts of David Hume and Adam Smith used the word "sympathy," but not "empathy," although the conceptual distinction marked by empathy was doing essential work in their writings. After discussing the early uses of these terms, this article is organized historically. Two traditions are distinguished. The first is the Anglo-American tradition, and it extends from Hume and Smith to the twenty-first century work of Michael Slote. Stephen Darwall’s contribution is applied in engaging Hume and Smith. Finally, the interrelation of empathy, sympathy and altruism is explored in the work of John Rawls and Thomas Nagel.  The second tradition is the Continental one. It extends from the spirituality of Johann Herder to the phenomenological movement of Edmund Husserl, Martin Heidegger, Max Scheler, and Edith Stein. The intentional analysis of empathy is directly relevant to the constitution of the social community in a broad, normative relationship with the "Other." Empathy (Einfühlung) is sui generis an intentional (mental) act that starts out in the superstructure of intersubjectivity in Husserl and steadily migrates towards the foundation of community under the influence of Heidegger, Scheler, and Stein. The choice of which philosophers and thinkers to include is also determined by the contingent facts that those chosen are most likely to be encountered in contemporary debates about empathy, sympathy, and ethics. Stein, Husserl, and Heidegger are primarily epistemological, ontological, and post-onto-theological, and are in the background of any contemporary, formal engagement with ethical theories, which is the focus of the present article. Scheler turns his phenomenological intuition of essence (wesenschau) towards the moral sentiments; and his analysis of the diversity of sympathetic forms is a lasting contribution to the topic. Contemporary Continental thinkers such as Larry Hatab and Frederick Olafson associate empathy with Heideggerian Mitsein and Mitdasein (being in the world with others) as the existential foundation of ethics). The roles of Friedrich Nietzsche, the Holocaust, and the "Other," especially in Emmanuel Levinas, are distinguishing marks of the ethical approach on the Continent. The article ends with a discussion of how the discipline of psychoanalysis contributes to the role of empathy.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. An Example and a Working Definition
  3. The Anglo-American Tradition
    1. Hume’s Many Meanings of “Sympathy”
    2. Adam Smith’s Philosophy of Sympathy
    3. Contractualism and Sympathy in Rawls
    4. Nagel’s Incomplete Version of Empathy
    5. Empathy as a Moral Criterion in Slote’s Ethics of Caring
  4. The Continental Tradition
    1. Nietzsche’s Empathy of Smell Complements His Suspicion
    2. The Challenge to Empathy of the Event of the Holocaust
    3. Ethics Against Empathy in Levinas
  5. Empathy in the Context of Psychoanalysis and Ethics
  6. A Common Root of Empathy and Ethics
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The words “sympathy” and “empathy” can be distinguished in several ways. Some of these distinctions are controversial, and work is needed to make them more precise. For example, “sympathy” is frequently used to mean one person’s response to the negative affects (suffering) of another individual, leading to pro-social (helping) behavior towards the other. In contrast, “empathy” generally includes responding to positive affects as well as negative ones without, however, necessarily requiring doing anything about it (no pro-social behavior required). “Sympathy” is understood to include agreement or approbation whereas “empathy” is often, though by no means always, a relatively neutral form of data gathering about the experiences and affects of others. “Sympathy” means a specific affective response such as compassion or pity whereas “empathy” once again encompasses affects in general including negative ones such as anger, fear, or resentment.

The words “empathy” and “sympathy” both point to the ancient Greek root “pathos” in the etymological context of modern English (Partridge 1966/1977).  “Pathos” in turn means to suffer in the sense of to endure, to undergo, or to be at the effect of. A single mention in Aristotle in the original Greek of empathes occurs in Aristotle’s On Dreams in which the coward experiences intense fear upon imagining that he sees his enemy approaching. In the original Greek, the references to empathes are few and marginal, generally meaning “in a state of intense emotion,” “passionate emotion,” or “much affected by,” a distinctly different meaning than it has today. The short list of other occurrences in antiquity is filled out by a single reference each in Plutarch’s Lives, in Flavius Jospheus Antiquitates Judaica, and Polybius Histories (entry on empathes in Liddell and Scott 1940).

In contrast, the number of references to “sympathy” is hundreds of entries long and is diverse, extending from Aeschylus, Aristophanes, Aristotle, Demosthenes, and frequently breaking though to the English in Shakespeare. The meanings include the constellation of ones that we would recognize including “agreement,” “pity,” “compassion,” “transmission of affect,” and “suggestibility.”

In the English language “empathy” simply did not exist prior to Cornell University psychologist Edward Bradford Titchner’s neologism in translating the German word “Einfühlung” as “empathy” in his lectures based on his work in the laboratory of Wilhelm Wundt (E. B. Titchener (1909)). Arguably the German is best captured by a phrase such as “feeling one’s way into,” but the advantages of a single word also have merit. Thus, it is technically an error, but one with an underlying kernel of truth, when one of the foremost researchers on empathy uses “empathy” as a substitute for “sympathy” as in the following from Hoffman: “And the British version of utilitarianism represented by David Hume, Adam Smith, and others for whom empathy was a necessary social bond, finds expression in current research on empathy, compassion, and the morality of caring” (2000: 2, 123). As noted, the word “empathy” did not exist in the English language when Hume (1739) and Smith (1759) write about engaging the foundations of morality in “sympathy,” the latter being the only word they used. Yet Hoffman captures an aspect of the truth as the word “sympathy” itself as used by Hume and Smith included the communicability of affect and emotional contagion, which today we would also count as inputs to “empathy” without, however, reducing empathy to emotional contagion and low level transmission of affect without remainder.

Prior to the arrival of the word “empathy” into the English language, “sympathy” captured the distinction “communicability of affect,” onto which additional meanings were layered. Hume and Smith are the main witnesses to this development. With the arrival of the word “empathy,” the difference between a method of data gathering about the experiences (sensations, affects, emotions) of other individuals and the use of this experience for ethically relevant processing, decision making, and evaluations was able to moved into the foreground.

Meanwhile, the Continental tradition reenacts in its own terms some of the same challenges in the German language that occurred around “sympathy” in the British tradition. Starting with Herder (1772/1792; see also Forster 2010: 19), and reaching to the 20th century in the writings of the phenomenologists such as Husserl, Scheler, and Stein a group of terms around “fühlen” [to feel] was occurring. Thus: “mitfühlen,” to “feel with” or “sympathize” and “nachfühlen,” to “feel vicariously” or even “to feel after” as in an after-image of a feeling. All these semantic distinctions emerged alongside “einfühlen,” to “empathize” or “to feel one’s way into” (Scheler 1913/22; Forster 2010: 39). Wilhelm Dilthey dismissed Einfühlung in favor of nacherleben [reexperiencing, reliving], nachfühlen (and Verstehen [understanding]) (see Makkreel 1975: 6-7, 252, 290). However, the point where these two traditions intersect is precise. The German psychologist Theodor Lipps translated Hume’s Treatise of Human Nature into German (1739/1904 Hume/Lipps) even as Lipps was completing his own Aesthetik (1903). Lipps eventually published the translation of Hume in two volumes in 1904/1906. Without directly borrowing what Hume said about “sympathy,” Lipps made empathy (Einfühlung) into the foundation of his aesthetics and an account of other minds. While “sympathy” comes across into German as “sympathie,” the seed was planted for the close connection between sympathy and (aesthetic) taste that developed into an entire aesthetic (Lipps 1903) in which Einfühlung (empathy) plays the central role. An entire generation of thinkers, including Freud, Husserl, and Heidegger, was inhibited from using the precise term “empathy” [“Einfühlung”]. Further more, when they did use it in the context of overcoming otherness, they marginalized it. This was because they were reluctant to invoke echoes of Lipps’ psychology of beauty and art – as well as Lipps’s solipsistic reveries that the individual psyche is what animates and enlivens nature and other individual through projective empathy. Scheler got it accurate dismissing Lipps’ “projective empathy”.

One of the innovations in the use of “empathy” in the 1950s is by the psychoanalyst Heinz Kohut (1959, 1971, 1977, 1984; Goldberg 1999). Kohut’s use is based on his view of philosophy of science (see the Hartmann-Nagel debate (Hartmann, 1959; E. Nagel 1959)) rather than in any usage in Freud, who mostly neglected the word but not the underlying distinction (Trosman & Simmons 1972; Freud 1909 where Einfühlung is explicitly used). Kohut’s use of “empathy” is a method of data gathering oriented towards a listening-based immersion in the affective, experiential, and mental life of the other person. However, even in a relatively value neutral inquiry such as psychoanalysis, the use of empathy as a method of data gathering has turned out to be relevant to ethics. Issues arise around the coherence and integrity of character and the self as a bulwark against unethical behavior such as rampant cheating, drug abuse, gambling, moral malaise and other individual, social, and communal ills.

2. An Example and a Working Definition

In the parable of the Good Samaritan (Luke 10: 30-27), the Priest and the Levite cross the road and pass by the Jewish traveler who was robbed, beaten by thieves, and left for dead. The Samaritan (today that would be a local inhabitant, a Palestinian) stops to help the individual in need. Multiple, overlapping descriptions are available of the Samaritan as a would-be moral agent. For example: The Samaritan’s altruism was aroused. His sympathy was aroused. His empathy was aroused. In the case of those who crossed the road and passed by the victim without stopping, the experience of empathic distress was decisive (arguably). They experienced the other’s suffering and were overwhelmed by it. They handled the empathic experience of suffering by avoiding the situation. In the case of the Samaritan, the empathic distress was transformed into sympathetic distress (under one description (Hoffman 2000: 87-88)), which, in turn, motivated a pro-social, helping, altruistic intervention to aide the traveler. An entirely different description is available: ethics is fundamental in attributing the altruistic decision from the start to a fundamental recognition on the part of the Samaritan, answering the question, “Who is my neighbor?” The answer?  The neighbor is the individual in need. By the end of this article, we shall not necessarily know which description is the truth with a capital “T,” but we shall have determined the terms of the debate and defined the issues in detail.

A working definition of “empathy” will be useful. At the level of phenomenal awareness of everyday human experience in the world with other humans, the minimal essential constituents of empathy include: (i) a receptivity (“openness”) to the affects of others whether in face-to-face encounter or as artifacts of human imagination (“empathic receptivity”); (ii) an understanding of the other in which the other individual is interpreted as a possibility—a possibility of choosing, making commitments, and implementing them (“empathic understanding”) in which the aforementioned possibility is implemented; (iii) an interpretation of the other from first-, second-, and third-person perspectives (“empathic interpretation”); and (iv) an articulation in language of this receptivity, understanding and interpretation, including the form of speech known as listening that enables the other to appreciate that he or she has been the target of empathy (“empathic listening”). In terms of the example of the Good Samaritan, the Samaritan is empathically receptive to the suffering of the traveler. This openness informs his understanding of the possibility that the other is a fellow traveler like himself. The other is interpreted as a neighbor (in the second person). This neighborliness is expressed in words and deeds by his stopping and altruistically giving assistance.

This working definition includes the possibility of alternative, orthogonal definitions, for example, from the perspective of functional causality. In the latter, another’s affects are the cause of mine in the context of a self-other distinction in which a causal construct such as a “shared manifold” is deployed below the threshold of introspective awareness in our biology (“neurology”) to explain the functions of perspective taking and emotional control (Gallese 2007). It is also consistent with a neuron-computational representation that uses mirror neurons to implement the transfer of affectivity from one individual to another (Jackson, Meltzoff, and Decety 2005; Decety & Jackson). It is consistent with a hermeneutic definition that deploys a double representation of the self’s representation of the other’s intentional fulfillment and the further processing of these representations (Agosta 2010; Husserl 1929/35; Stein 1917; Zahavi 2005).  As we shall see, “sympathy” in Hume corresponds to at least two of these definitions of the communicability of affect and the ability to put oneself in the other’s place ((ideal) perspective taking). In addition, he has two definitions that do not overlap with empathy – a reactive response that is compassionate and caring towards another’s suffering and (as Hume uses it) the power of suggestion (to which we now turn).

3. The Anglo-American Tradition

a. Hume’s Many Meanings of “Sympathy”

David Hume has at least four distinct meanings of "sympathy." These develop along with his thinking about the foundations of ethics. First, “sympathy” functions in the communicability of affect; next it encompasses what is often described as “emotional contagion,” the communicability of affect without the inclusion of the idea of the other individual as its source; additionally, it encompasses the power of suggestion; and, finally, it comes to include an element of benevolence. How this series of transformations unfolds is the topic of this story as the meaning of “sympathy” evolves from a communicability of affect to the responsive sentiment of compassion which is one of the essential ways that we regard sympathy today.

Always the astute phenomenologist, the philosopher, David Hume, witnesses the divergence of sympathy into components that will blend with the judgment of taste, taking on an irreversible dimension of evaluation, across both an ethical and aesthetic dimension. Other components identified by Hume develop into the form of human empathy known to us as the mere communicability of affect, subject to further cognitive processing. By the time Hume writes his 1741 essay “Of the delicacy of taste and passion,” he assimilates all the advantages for human interrelations of “sympathy” such as friendship, intimacy, interpersonal warmth to “delicacy of taste” (1741: 25-28; 1757: 3-24). Hume’s contribution to the transformations of sympathy has a significant subtlety and depth that deserves a substantial treatment of its own much longer than that engaged here.

By “sympathy” Hume does not initially mean the particular sentiments of pity or compassion or benevolence but rather the function of communicating affect in general. Relying on his simple psychology of ideas and impression, sympathy reverses the operation of the understanding, which converts impressions of sensation into ideas. In the case of sympathy, the operation is in the other direction – from idea to impression. Sympathy arouses ideas in the recipient that are transformed into impressions – though this time impressions of reflection - through the influence of the ideas. Thus, the operation of sympathy:

‘Tis indeed evident, that when we sympathize with the passions and sentiments of others, these movements appear at first in our mind as mere ideas, and are conceiv’d to belong to another person, as we conceive any other matter of fact. ‘Tis also evident, that the ideas of the affections of others are converted into the very impressions they represent, and that the passions arise in conformity to the images we form of them (T; SBN 319-20).

Sympathy reverses the operation of the understanding, which transforms impressions of sensation into ideas. Sympathy arouses impressions through the influence of ideas. The functional basis of this sympathetic conversion will turn out to be the imagination. In this view, sympathy is not to be mistaken with some particular affect such as pity or compassion, but is rigorously defined by Hume as “the conversion of an idea into an impression by the force of imagination” (T; SBN 427).  The other’s anger gets expressed and is apprehended sympathetically as an idea, which idea is communicated to me, and, in turn, through the sympathetic work of the imagination, arouses a corresponding impression of my own. This is an impression of reflection that is fainter and calmer than the initial idea (or impression) of anger. (An “impression of reflection” is an impression of an idea or (in some cases) of a vivid impression.) I thus experience what may be variously described as a trace affect, a counter-part feeling, or a vicarious experience—of anger.

In short, the one individual now knows what the other is experiencing because she experiences it too, not as the numerically identical impression, but as one that is qualitatively similar. This operation of sympathy, at least in this example, is also crucially distinct from emotional contagion, as in the mass behavior of crowds, since the passion and sentiments are “conceived to belong to another person.” This is crucial. This introduces the other and the distinction between one individual and the other. Significantly, the concept of the other accompanies the impression that is aroused in the one individual as a result of the other’s expression.

Hume distinguishes between sympathy and emotional contagion (T; SBN 316-7; T; SBN 592). Sympathy requires a double representation. What the other is feeling is represented in a vicarious feeling, which is what sympathy shares with emotional contagion. However, sympathy in the full sense also requires a representation of the other as the source of the first representation, “conceived to belong to the other person” (T; SBN 319-20). The distinction “other” is what is missing in the case of emotional contagion.

Hume establishes sympathy as the glue that affectively binds others to oneself and, by implication, binds a community of ethical individuals together. One of the undisputed masters of the English language in his own day (and ours), Hume asserts that “the minds of men are mirrors to one another, not only because they reflect each others emotions, but also because those rays of passions, sentiments and opinions may be often reverberated and decay away by insensible degrees” (T; SBN 365). Here one does experience an immediate resonance (“reverberation”) with the other, perceiving pleasure in the smile, pain in the grimace, or anger in the clenched teeth. In this case, a counterpart feeling - a vicarious feeling - is aroused in oneself and, in turn, becomes the experiential basis for further cognitive activity about what is going on with the other person.

However, Hume finds now that he is at risk of having undercut ethics by giving to sympathy such a central role in creating community. Experience shows that sympathy is diminished by distance of time and proximity and relatedness (“acquaintance”). We are much less affected by the pleasures and pains of those at a great distance than by those in our immediate physical vicinity or (say) close family relations. So an earthquake in China creates less sympathetic distress in me than an earthquake in Los Angeles (in my own country), even if I am perfectly safe in either case. According to Hume, my ethical approbation of (and obligations to) those at a great distance from me are no less strong than to those close at hand. The balance of impartiality needs to be restored by appealing to an unbiased ideal observer. In turn, this sets up a tension between the sympathetic observer of the moral agent and the ideal, unbiased one. “Unbiased” does not mean “unsympathetic”; yet it does not mean “wholly sympathetic” either. This is an issue. The ideal observer and the sympathetic one are complementary at best, and possibly even contrary. Being sympathetic reduces distance between individuals; being an ideal observer creates distance. Let us now look at two possible ways of resolving the tension between the ideal observer and sympathy as the basis for moral approbation and disapproval. (Slote will have a third approach considered in detail further below.)

The first is due to Stephen Darwall’s reading of Hume as going beyond moral sentiment (at least implicitly) to rule regulation in accounting for such artificial virtues as justice and related convention-based virtues like adhering to contracts. Hume says that the motivation to justice is produced through sympathy in observing the beneficial results of justice (Darwall 1995: 314-5). Indeed Hume expresses what would become a very Kantian approach, though whether he does so consistently is an issue: “[W]e have no real or universal motive for observing the laws of equity but the very equity and merit of that observance” (SBN: 483). And: “’Tis evident we have no motive leading us to the performance of promises, distinct from a sense of duty. If we thought, that promises had no moral obligation, we never shou’d feel any inclination to observe them” (SBN 518; quoted in Darwall 1995: 302). It is easy to agree with Darwall’s general conclusion that Hume points towards the result that a virtue such as justice requires a rule-based obligation without explicitly embracing it, going beyond empirical naturalism, to account for justice. Through Darwall’s argumentative force, subtlety, and mastery of the details, both sympathy and the ideal observer are undercut, resulting in a Hume that reads much like Kant. This is not Hume’s point of view, though he anticipates and inspired Kant. Hume is not a closet Kantian.  Sympathy is a source of information about the experience of the other individual. But that is not all. Hume’s commitment is that, in addition to the latter, sympathy is also a source of morality. Thus, Hume is constrained to evolve “sympathy” in the direction of “compassion” and “benevolence” to maintain his program. Darwall does not follow him there, but, as we shall see, it is a matter of controversy whether the modern account of empathy should do so.

The second approach is a reconstruction of the disinterested spectator as the sympathetic spectator. In other words, the key term “disinterested” means lacking a “conflict of interest,” not “unsympathetic” in the sense of “inhumanly cold-hearted”. The ideal spectator has to be sympathetic, not in the sense of benevolent (which “sympathy” has come to mean in part thanks to Hume’s usage), but in the sense of openness to the communicability of affect. Appreciating what the other is feeling is a useful, though not always decisive, data point in evaluating the ethical qualities of the agent being considered in the judgment of approbation. It makes a difference in contemplating the moral worth of someone making a charitable gift whether it is done with the feeling of pleasure in being better than the poor wretches who are its beneficiaries or with a trace feeling of the suffering of the other individual, which one’s gift might relieve. What the other is experiencing is useful input to the process of ethical assessment of the quality of character of the individual in question. As sympathy is enlarged in Hume beyond the narrow scope of one’s family and friends, it gives way to benevolence, an interest in the well-being of all mankind, as the basis of morality, while “sympathy” as a term used by Hume is trimmed back and reduced to emotional contagion.

Historically, what Hume does next is to develop his understanding (and definition) of “sympathy” in the direction of “benevolence.” “Sympathy” converges with benevolence as the latter supplements it in the founding of morality in an Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals (1751). Without appreciating the consequences for his use of “sympathy,” Hume starts developing the idea in the direction of “benevolence,” the latter being specific benefits that interest us in the good of mankind:

‘Tis true, when the cause is compleat, and a good disposition is attended with  good fortune, which renders it really beneficial to society, it gives a stronger pleasure to the spectator, and is attended with a more lively sympathy (T; SBN 585).

Virtue in rags is still virtue, as Hume famously notes, and sympathy interests us in the good of all mankind (“society”) (T; SBN 584), including communities distant from us in location or time. In answering the objection that “good intentions are not good enough for morality,” Hume argues back in so many words that good intentions are indeed good enough, granted that good intentions plus good consequences (results) are even better. However, “sympathy” has now taken on the content of benevolence, that is, an interest in furthering the well being of mankind, not just being open to man’s experiences, including suffering. By the time Hume’s Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals is published in 1751, “sympathy” has been downgraded to the power of suggestion, nothing more; and the basis of morality is shifted to such sentiments as benevolence, displaying qualities useful and agreeable to oneself and others.

In the following passage in Treatise, we witness Hume’s development of the meaning of “sympathy”. “Sympathy” migrates from a communicability of affect, which includes a concept of the other that aligns with the modern concept of “empathy,” towards a narrower, but not exclusive, sense of emotional contagion. Within the context of the Treatise, Hume builds a complete sense of sympathy out of the contagiousness of the passions by adding the idea of the other to the communicability of affect. In the Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals the contagiousness of the passions is all that will remain of sympathy:

‘Tis remarkable, that nothing touches a man of humanity more than any instance of extraordinary delicacy in love or friendship, where a person is attentive to the smallest concerns of his friend. . . The passions are so contagious, that they pass with the greatest facility from one person to another, and produce correspondent movements in all human breast. Where friendship appears in very signal instances, my heart catches the same passion, and is warmed by those warm sentiments, that display themselves me (T; SBN 604-5).

When put in context, this points to a remarkable development in Hume’s thinking. Hume moves sympathy from the center to the periphery of his account of human judgments (approbation and disapproval). This is complimented by the contrary movement of taste from the periphery to the center. The social advantages of sympathy in forming human relationships – friendship, enjoyment of the “characters of men,” fellow feeling, and sensitivity to how one’s actions have an impact on others – are shifted elsewhere, amazingly enough in the direction of the aesthetic sense of taste.

Hume explicitly writes:

Thus the distinct boundaries and offices of reason and of taste are easily ascertained. The former conveys the knowledge of truth and falsehood; the latter give the sentiment of beauty and deformity, vice and virtue (1751: 173f., 269; emphasis added).

Thus, Hume is engaging in what we might describe a journey back from morality to its foundation and infrastructure in taste. By 1751, “sympathy” has been reduced in Hume’s work to “natural sympathy,” which overlaps substantially with what we would today call “the power of suggestion”. The merit of benevolence and its utility in promoting the good of mankind through attributes useful and agreeable to oneself and others looms large in founding morality (for example, Hume 1751: 241).

By the time of the Enquiry (1751), the push down of “sympathy” behind compassion and taste is complete. The reactive aspects of “sympathy” get split off and migrate in the direction of compassion. Compassion takes on the content of qualities useful to mankind as benevolence. Taste dominates the field of fine-grained distinctions in the communicability of feelings between persons (“friends”) as well as in the appreciation of beauty.  This former point is essential. Taste gives us an enjoyment of the qualities of the characters of persons in conversation, humor, and friendship that are a super-set of what empathy does today in our current usage with its fine-grained distinctions in accessing the experiences of other persons. The prospect of “delicacy of sympathy” in the social realm of human interrelations is left without further development by Hume. The true heir to Hume’s undeveloped “delicacy of sympathy”, without, however, explicitly having any idea of it, is the psychoanalyst Heinz Kohut whose transformations of empathy include humor, appreciation of art, and wisdom (Kohut 1966).

The other main witness to the vicissitudes of sympathy is Adam Smith, to whom we now turn.

b. Adam Smith’s Philosophy of Sympathy

Adam Smith explicitly distinguishes between sympathy and compassion (pity) in his 1759 The Theory of the Moral Sentiments. He also acknowledges a traditional overlap between the two, noting, however, the generalization of sympathy:

Pity and compassion are words appropriated to signify our fellow-feeling with the sorrow of others, sympathy, though its meaning was, perhaps, originally the same, may now, however, without much impropriety, be made use of to denote our fellow-feeling with any passion whatever (1759: 49).

Here sympathy is not some separate reactive affect that occurs in witnessing the pain and suffering of another individual. Rather sympathy operates as the communicability of affect (the passions) regardless of the particular passion. “Fellow feeling” is used as a high level category that enables Smith stylistically to suggest nuances and fine-grained distinctions in his phenomenological descriptions. An argument might be made that, when all is said and done, “sympathy” and “fellow feeling” are used synonymously by Smith. For example, in defining sympathy, Smith cannot use the same term without succumbing to the logical fallacy of petitio principi:

As we have no immediate experience of what other men feel, we can form no idea of the manner in which they are affected, but by conceiving what we ourselves should feel in the like situation [. . . . ] [I]t is by the imagination only that we can form any conception of what are his sensations [. . . .] By the imagination we place ourselves in his situation, we conceive ourselves enduring all the same torments, we enter as it were into his body, and become in some measure the same person with him, and thence form some idea of his sensation, and even feel something which, though weaker in degree, is not altogether unlike them. [. . . .] That this is the source of our fellow-feeling for the misery of others, that it is by changing places in fancy with the sufferer, that we come either to conceive or to be affected by what he feels, may be demonstrated by many obvious observations . . . (1759: 47-8)

In addition to using “fellow feeling” to define “sympathy,” the mechanism by which sympathy operates is the imagination. Specifically, it is the taking of the perspective of the other in the other’s situation. This points to three results.

(1) If “sympathy” is not synonymous with “fellow feeling,” then what is the difference? Sympathy is not responsive in the sense of pity or compassion, the latter being reactions to the suffering of another. Yet sympathy has its responsive dimension. Sympathy requires a responsive approbation or disapprobation of the beneficial or mischievous conduct of the other individual. In Smith, sympathy is fellow feeling plus (dis)approbation:

That where there is no approbation of the conduct of the person who confers the benefit, there is little sympathy with the gratitude of him who receives it: and that, on the contrary, where there is no disapprobation of the motives of the person who does the mischief, there is no sort of sympathy with the resentment of him who suffers it (1759: 143; chapter abstract).

This is a definitive textual answer. Of course, “little sympathy” is perhaps distinct from “absolutely and positively no sympathy”. But this is just understatement for effect. Sympathy is simply missing in the case of an unmerited boon conferred by a would-be benefactor. The bounds of (dis)approbation align closely with those of sympathy. Ultimately, sympathy is the basis of the moral sentiments for Smith because “to sympathize with” means “to align with the estimation of right or wrong based on fellow feeling”. The nuances that arise are many and varied; but Smith is more consistent than he is generally credited in standardly using sympathy as the source of intuitions about the merit (or demerit) of other individuals. This extends not only to their conduct but in the heartfelt attitude they bring to the conduct and its consequences. When we sympathize with the other – approving or disapproving based on the other’s perspective (not one’s own) – then we are aligned with the values of the shared community, especially the community of well-bred English gentlemen. When sympathy breaks down, when we have no fellow feeling with the other, then it is a strong indication that the other has put himself outside the community and is blameworthy, lacking merit. The result is an ethics of the well-bred English gentleman, including his attachments to reputation, prudence, temperance, and so on.

In addition, Smith’s spectator-like perspective aligns with that of the second person in contrast with Hume’s which has a closer resemblance to that of the third person. Stephen Darwall is keenly aware of this and makes the point: “It is not far wrong, indeed, to think of Smith as one of the first philosophers of the ‘second person,’ if not the very first” (Darwall 2006: 46). In many contexts, especially those is which (dis)approbation is not the main issue, Smith’s use of “sympathy” is indistinguishable from “communicability of affect”. This has led some commentators to equate Smith’s use of “sympathy” with empathy pure-and-simple. Thus Darwall, keenly aware of his own second person inquiry:

I prefer to use ‘sympathy’ for feelings of concern for others that are felt, not entirely as from their own point of view, but as from a third-person perspective of one who cares for them, and to use ‘empathy’ for feelings that either imaginatively enter into the other’s standpoint or result from his feelings by contagion (Darwall 2006: 45).

Of course, Darwall’s previous point is that Smith’s usage (unlike Hume’s) is precisely to take the second person perspective. Therefore, for Darwall, Smith’s usage of “sympathy” requires revision to equate “sympathy” with the third-person perspective, leaving room to rewrite the text using “empathy”. However, Darwall arguably overlooks the point indicated in the above-cited quote that, for Smith, sympathy is fellow-feeling plus (dis)approbation, not fellow feeling pure-and-simple.

(2) Do we merely “conceive what we ourselves should feel in the like situation” or are we allowed (or even required) to take on the characteristics of the other in so far as we are able to do so? This is similar to the question “How complete is the identification with the other?” While the above-cited text suggests that the one individual carries his or her characteristics into the situation of the other, the analysis does not stop there. To be sure, a person never completely stops being himself; yet the meta-rule is to put oneself in the other’s situation with the other’s character and circumstance:

But though sympathy is very properly said to arise from an imaginary change of situations with the person principally concerned, yet this imaginary change is not supposed to happen to me in my own person and character, but in that of the person with whom I sympathize. When I condole with you for the loss of your only son, in order to enter into your grief, I do not consider what I, a person of such a character and profession, should suffer, if I had a son, and if that son was unfortunately to die; but I consider what I should suffer if I was really you; and I not only change circumstances, but I change persons and characters. My grief, therefore, is entirely upon your account, and not in the least upon my own. It is not, therefore, in the least selfish (1759: 501-2).

We imagine what it would be like to be the other person with the other’s character. The ideal spectator runs a cognitive simulation in which one may indeed begin with one’s own characteristics as input, but quarantines one’s own peculiarities in favor of those of the other. To be sure, such an exercise is bound to be imperfect and incomplete. There is a strong identification, yet it remains transient, temporary, and incomplete. At that point, sentiments of approbation or disapprobation emerge, which inform the individual’s moral assessment of the situation and the other person in it.

(3) What is involved in feeling what the other feels, yet not approving of it? Smith allows an extensive continuum of degrees of fellow feeling, reaching from a slight hint of what the other is feeling to full blown identification. Sympathy mostly falls in the middle of this spectrum, a transient and trial identification with the other, soon interrupted. The one individual feels what the other feels, yet not quite as intensely. It seems as though there ought to be a logical space for the possibility of fellow feeling without sympathetic (dis)approbation, given that these are not completely synonymous. Yet it does not seem to occur to Smith to allow it. Consider the situation of the condemned criminal about to be hanged.

When an inhuman murder is brought to the scaffold, though we have some compassion for his misery, we can have no sort of fellow-feeling with his resentment, if he should be so absurd as to express any against either his prosecutor or his judgment (1759: 145).

Indeed we adopt the sentiments of the prosecutor and judgment. Taking a hint from Smith’s language here, we can say that the criminal has placed himself outside the limits of the human community with his murderous deeds, a human community from which he is about to be ejected by being hanged. The lesson learned here is that we may have compassion for lower forms of life, but sympathy is arguably co-extensive with the human and defines the foundation of our participation in the community. For Smith, “sympathize with” is synonymous with “align with the other’s feeling in such a way as to approve or disapprove along with the other” (not a quote from Smith, but Smith’s bottom line).

c. Contractualism and Sympathy in Rawls

John Rawl’s magisterial A Theory of Justice (1971) contains sections on features of the moral sentiments and moral psychology, including a discussion of sympathy and the impartial sympathetic spectator. After the parties in a would-be society have adopted the principles of justice as fairness in the original position, the result is Kantian. Natural abilities such as strength, intelligence, inherited gifts, are unevenly distributed to individuals but are a collective asset so that the more fortunate are to benefit in ways that help those who are least well endowed. Inequalities are arranged for reciprocal advantage. By abstaining from the exploitation of the accidents of nature and social contingencies with the framework of equal liberty and the difference principle, persons express their respect for one another in the constitution of society itself (Rawls 1971: 179). Can this capture the utilitarian approach of the impartial, sympathetic spectator? At first it seems that it can:

Now while it is possible to supplement the impartial spectator definition with the contract point of view, there are other ways of giving it a deductive basis. Thus suppose that the ideal observer is thought of as a perfectly sympathetic being. Then there is a natural derivation of the classical principle of utility along the following lines. An institution is right, let us say, if an ideally sympathetic and impartial spectator would approve of it more strongly than any other institution feasible in the circumstances. For simplicity we may assume, as Hume sometimes does, that approval is a special kind of pleasure [. . . ] This special pleasure is the result of sympathy. In Hume’s account it is quire literally a reproduction in our experience of the satisfactions and pleasures which we recognize to be felt by others [. . . .] Men’s natural capacity for sympathy suitably generalized provides the perspective from which they can reach an understanding on a common conception of justice. (1971: 185-6)

In either case, contractual or utilitarian, the argument moves in the direction of fairness and equilibrium; yet the original (contractual) position more accurately captures the human condition – namely, that individuals have distinct abilities and gifts. In Rawl’s original position, the parties are behind the “veil of ignorance,” disinterested and lacking knowledge of their natural abilities or social situation. Inequalities are just only if they result in compensating benefits for everyone. In contrast, the classical utilitarians have perfect knowledge and sympathetic identification. Both result in a correct estimate of the net sum of satisfaction. But classical utilitarianism fails to distinguish between persons, in effect collapsing distinct persons with distinct abilities into a one dimensional, impartial sympathetic spectator.  The parties in the original position would not agree to the approvals of the impartial sympathetic spectator as the standard of justice, according to Rawls. Why not? Such a spectator does not have access to the concept of risk – the risk that one might be born poor and marginalized rather than (say) rich and in the main stream. It simply is not captured. The veil of ignorance is designed to yield principles of justice as fairness whereby, even if your antipathetic enemy is choosing what role you will play in society (presumably you will end up poor and with limited natural abilities), the advantages that the other party has will be distributed in such a way as to contribute to everyone’s advantage. In contrast, for the impartial sympathetic spectator to yield justice as fairness, the parties are conceived as perfect altruists, whose desires conform to the approvals of such a spectator. “The greater net balance of happiness with which to sympathize, the more a perfect altruist achieves his desire” (1971: 189). In fact, the world is filled with individuals with competing interests, who, moreover, are antipathetic (hostile) to one another, and the utilitarian aligns everyone’s interests in a most counter-intuitive way. Justice is not necessary unless individuals are antipathetic and the interests of individuals come into conflict, the actual situation of the real world. In a world of conflicting interests, sympathy still has a role to play in transmitting affects, but it is not foundational. Is there then a logical space between self-interest and duty to account for the relationship between empathy and altruism?

d. Nagel’s Incomplete Version of Empathy

In Nagel’s argument, the interest of others in the world and one’s own interest are in balance. It is not that the world comes ahead of one’s own – which, arguably, would look like utilitarianism and the greatest good of the greatest number. Although consequences are inevitably a part of the description of the ethical dilemma, the determination of interest is not exclusively reducible to the consequential calculation. Rather we are looking formally and logically at the priority of one’s own interest over against that of the other individuals in the world, and one’s own interest does not have any more priority. But it does not necessarily have any less, for the majority of the world would not be justified in inflicting pain on one individual even if it resulted in their greater good anymore than one individual would be justified in doing so to the majority. Is there a logical space available to establish a link between empathy and the austere ethics of duty (deontology) based on the structure of action? This is needed to avoid succumbing to the reactivity of moral sentiments (shame, guilt, benevolence, compassion, and so on). These are powerful motivators of moral behavior, and as such deserve cultivation, but are logically dubious founders of it.

This argument enables Thomas Nagel (1970) in effect to say “Act so as to reduce the pain (of persons) in the world.” Depending on one’s perspective, this is a special case by way of generalization of the self-interested maxim to “act so as to reduce my own pain” along with “I am in the world with others” and “we are all others (persons)”.  For example, in being altruistic, both my own pain and that of the other are regarded impersonally. Actions that reduce my pain remain self-interested in an obvious way – I am no longer in pain. Acts that reduce the pain of the other are just an impersonal version of my acting to reduce the pain experienced personally.

The next step was not taken by Nagel who elsewhere disparages a version of empathy based on an incomplete and misleading definition. Nagel calls for “an objective phenomenology not dependent on empathy or the imagination” (1974: 402); but this phenomenology may turn out to be inconsistent with his commitment to finite human understanding. Without empathy and the imagination, the bat’s experience becomes the inaccessible thing in itself (ding an sich). The bat is the one who does not know what it is like to be a bat, since the bat lacks my concept of battiness (not to mention such distinctions as echo-location, flying mouse, and mammal). In Nagel 1970 he writes: “Any justification ends finally with the rationally gratuitous presence of the emotion of sympathy; if that condition were not met, one would simply have no reason to be moral” (1970: 11). Here “sympathy” means “pity” or “compassion” or “benevolence,” rather than the possibility of communicating any possible affect or sensation, which was Hume’s initial and primary meaning of “sympathy” (see Hume 1739: 319).

Yes, I should so act to reduce the pain in the world, including the other’s and my own too. But how do I know the other is in pain? The answer is empathy. In any particular situation and with apologies to Kant, altruism without empathy (sympathy) is like a concept without intuition. The vicarious experience of the other’s pain and the processing of it in empathic receptivity and interpretation is an essential part of how the would-be altruist comes to know of the other’s distress. This does not mean I cannot be wrong. It means that I can advance from the possibility of altruism to its implementation in actual situations through marshalling, capturing, and organizing the evidence of interrelational receptivity through empathy. Having established then that empathy provides an essential input to ethical altruism, is it perhaps capable of being elaborated into a foundation for an ethics of caring?

e. Empathy as a Moral Criterion in Slote’s Ethics of Caring

Michael Slote (2007, 2010) finds in empathy the basis for an ethics of caring that provides the basis for a moral sentimentalism. Drawing mainly on Hume, with an occasional nod to Smith, Slote shifts the analysis from an evaluation of behavior to the moral worth of agents engaging in action. One’s ability to empathize defines the boundary of the human community or as Slote puts it (2010: 13) provides “cement of the moral universe”. Slote finds significant inspiration in Hutcheson’s idea of a moral sense of approval or disapproval. Slote then substitutes empathy for that moral sense, however, with significant conditions and qualifications (2010: 33-4). Slote argues that empathy provides an “understandable mechanism for moral approval and disapproval” (2010: 33), lending philosophic rigor to the mere metaphor of moral sense. Slote claims to identify a second order empathy:

In particular, if agents’ actions reflect empathic concern for (the well-being or wishes of) others, empathic beings will feel warmly or tenderly toward them, and such warmth and tenderness empathically reflect the empathic warmth or tenderness of the agents. I want to say that such (in one sense) reflective feeling, such empathy with empathy, also constitutes moral approval, and possibly admiration as well, for agents and/or their actions (2010:  34-5).

Let us return to our paradigm example of the Good Samaritan and see how this works. We are fine as long as the Good Samaritan, for example, feels warmly or tenderly towards the traveler who was waylaid by robbers and left for dead. Empathy is properly understood as requiring a communicability of affect between the rescuer and the observer – in this case Slote or the ideal observer – who approve or disapprove of the moral worth of the agent. Of course, we can contingently imagine that the Samaritan, in the act of helping the stranger, recognizes that what he is doing has significant value, acknowledging himself for his good character and producing a warm feeling, whether of self-approval or mere self-recognition. This warm feeling of the Samaritan, in turn, becomes the target for the empathy of the ideal observer, who experiences a trace affect of it. However, the example works less well if the Samaritan is too busy helping the other to consider self-recognition or –acknowledgement. Even more, the example works not at all if the Samaritan, who is actually a Palestinian, sees that the victim is a Hebrew settler, but, in spite of their being sworn enemies, he recognizes the suffering humanity through a trace affect of suffering disclosed in his empathic receptivity, and decides, in spite of his antipathic negative feeling, to come to the traveler’s aid, not because of any feeling but because that is what duty requires of him. Ambivalence is not a problem and is likely in most scenarios (see Greenspan 1980).

Further issues loom for Slote with altruism, which is considered in more detail in his first empathy book, which complements the later one consistently (2007, 2010). Thus, he distinguishes empathy as a method of accessing the experiences of the other from specific emotions such as compassion, pity, love, and so on. However, Slote then mixes empathy with altruism: “A person who is fully empathic with and concerned about others will sometimes give up something that she wants in order to help another person gain something good” (Slote 2007: 116). In this context, Slote points out that this “give up something” is not irrational. Indeed it is not. This sounds like altruism because that is what it is. Only if “rationality” is mistaken for one’s own narrow self-interest (not Slote’s problem), whether long or short term, does it become impossible to help others without falling into unqualified egoism. In general, when, on the basis of empathy, a person does something to help another person, the helping shows up as a form of altruism. Thus Slote:

The criterion offered [. . .] in terms of empathic caring was a moral criterion, a criterion of moral permissibility, and when I spoke of supererogation, I was again speaking in specifically moral terms. In that sense, too, the empathically caring individual can be characterized as possessing (a) moral virtue, and I think it is fair to say that the present book has been primarily interested in the moral aspect of the ethics of care (Slote 2007: 118).

The moral aspect of the ethics of caring is precisely empathy, according to Slote. However, contra Slote, empathy does not require that one do anything other than listen empathically and talk empathically in response, thus falling short of the practical caring (for example, serving dinner) intended here by Slote. Indeed a quiet, rich empathic silence is often sufficient. If one decides to take action on the basis of empathy, then the action may be altruistic if the beneficiary is a stranger or the action may be caring (in the narrow sense of feeding one’s own hungry child) if the beneficiary is someone “near and dear,” who one is obligated to attend to in any case. Thus, it is important to distinguish directly helping others by caring for their physical needs, feeding the hungry, binding up the wounds of the injured, sheltering the injured traveler, and so on, and empathizing with the other in such a way to allow the other to regain their emotional equilibrium when it has been lost or upset (admittedly by traumas and suffering). If a person telling a moving story is moved to tears in the course of the narrative, strictly speaking, offering the individual a tissue to dry his eyes is an action. However, it is a largely symbolic gesture that says “I recognize the human suffering and wish to comfort it” rather than an action such as that of the Roman Centurion who cuts his cloak in half and gives it to the freezing beggar.

It is a useful rule of thumb that altruism ministers to one’s physical (bodily) needs whereas empathy responds to and is aroused by a person’s emotional and affective expressions of animate life. The two can diverge dramatically. For example, after the fall of the Soviet Union Rumanian orphanages were understaffed, bare bones institutions that rigged up mechanical, assembly line-like ways of delivering bottled milk to infants, like feeders in a bird cage. The results were the production of symptoms developmentally similar to neurological damage, autism, and infantile psychosis (M. A. Diego and N. A. Jones 2007:   161; Spitz 1946). Many of these symptoms were able to be reversed by adoptive, caring, nurturing parents, but, depending on the duration of the neglect, not all.

Much is made of the short circuiting of action in and by empathy by professional practitioners of empathy. This is due to the uses of empathy in psychotherapy, counseling, and psychoanalysis. In such situations, it would be counterproductive, if not harmful, for the therapist actively to intervene altruistically in the client’s life with specific maxims and advice about what to do. Psychotherapy activates many boundaries between therapist and client, including ethical ones and ones of action. Psychotherapy provides a counter-example to Slote. Neither therapeutic empathy nor empathic distress are a motive for action, though they can clarify the context of action or provide insight into both reasons and causes. If one grasps aspects of the other and his situation through empathy, then one may discover reasons that one did not know were relevant or engaged by his character or that character in a particular situation.

Next, going beyond imperfect duties such as altruism to perfect ones, Slote offers a general criterion of right and wrong action based in the notion of empathy – specifically empathic caring or concern for others:

[. . . ] One can claim that actions are morally wrong and contrary to moral obligation if, and only if, they reflect or exhibit or express an absence (or lack) of fully developed empathic concern for (or caring about) others on the part of the agent (2007: 31).

Slote proposes that empathy – more precisely, “empathic caring” – is a moral criterion. Are we then obligated to strive to develop our empathy (empathic caring) so that we are equal to the criterion? Slote does not explicitly assert that we are obligated to develop our empathy; yet without empathy we do not flourish as humans.

Slote asserts that he does not advocate implementing an obligation to be empathic. However, this risks getting stranded on the horns of a dilemma. First of all, such an obligation (Slote asserts) would set a bar too high for most people, given that we do not get training in empathy, and so risk violating the “ought implies can” injunction. That is, we cannot create an obligation, which we know in advance that we cannot live up to. Yet if we are to advance to “fully developed empathic concern” do we not have an obligation to develop empathy even if it is not required in any particular situation? At the very least, empathy would be an “imperfect duty to self and others” similar to developing one’s talents and gifts – empathy, humor, charity, wisdom - and using them to create community and a flourishing society.

“Fully developed empathic concern” is doing a lot of the work for Slote here. It will contain all the conditions and qualifications required to restrict empathic concern from requiring supererogatory deeds. Empathic concern does not. Empathic concern includes those geographically remote, and excluding them would unfairly subject them to violations of obligations. Empathic concern allows for the development of empathy in those whose initial (“natural”) endowments of it may be less generous than the average individual (practice improves talent).  The argument is instructive and useful – as well as ad hoc.

In order to preserve empathy as a moral criterion, even against these issues, Slote argues against describing empathy as partialist (favoring those “near and dear”). Slote argues against the common sense intuition that people initially seem to have less empathy towards those who are different – different race (skin color), different religion, different gender, different diet than those to whom one is partial such as one’s family (2007: 35). Unfortunately, distrust seems to be the default attitude towards strangers, and often with good reason. Therefore, in a reaction formation meant to manage mistrust, many traditional cultures make it obligatory to shelter and protect guests. What better way than carefully to keep watch over them than to declare they are “guests”?

It is a further question of how the example of the Good Samaritan affects our own empathic receptivity as potential (ideal) observers of the would-be moral agent. In observing the suffering of the victim of the robbers as well as observing the Samaritan’s empathic suffering with the victim, we (as observers) have several empathic experiences. Like the Samaritan, we empathize directly with the distress of the victim. We also experience the suffering of the Samaritan who experiences a double pain. The Samaritan experiences first the vicarious experience (pain) of the suffering of the victim. In addition, the Samaritan experiences the pain experienced in sacrificing his own time, effort, and money in interrupting his (the Samaritan’s) trip, binding up the victims wounds, and leaving him with the Inn Keeper, promising to pay for any additional expenses upon his return. If the Samaritan gives himself credit for his good deed, in effect saying to himself “I acknowledge myself as an agent for doing the right thing in a tough spot,” then we (as observers) can arguably also have an empathic experience of the warm feeling of that self acknowledgement. Slote finds in this experience a second order empathy (Slote 2010: 39) that contains a warm feeling of approval. Slote then finds in this experience an important contribution to the moral basis of an ethics of caring. Some critics find this second order empathy to be a mis-description of the phenomenon, mistaking a response of what Hoffman calls “sympathetic distress” towards the suffering of the other for empathy (Hoffman 2000: 87-8). Indeed Hoffman, who is consistently cited by Slote with agreement, clearly distinguishes “empathic distress” from “sympathetic distress,” granted that Slote does not use such a distinction. For empathy to become an input to morality, it is first transformed from “empathic distress” into “sympathetic distress,” at which point the latter can become the motive for pro-social (altruistic) behavior such as the Samaritan’s (Hoffman 2000: 87-88).

It is a matter of controversy that empathy includes a warm feeling of approval (as asserted by Slote 2010: 36-41). Slote implicitly lines up with Rawls where approval provides a special kind of pleasure, granted that Rawls (like Hume) restricts the argument to “sympathy” (Rawls 1971: 185-6). Approval or disapproval is not the only ethical response possible. Empathy is distinct from (ethical) approval in that it gives rise to a whole host of downstream responses (reactions). As distinct from empathy, certain forms of antipathy can also be marshaled as when a (hostile) enemy of the traveler experiences Schadenfreude (delight at someone’s misfortune) upon witnessing the latter’s misfortune. Indeed what makes the parable so powerful and dramatic is that the Samaritan (Palestinian) is actually the enemy of the victim, but through empathy recognizes suffering humanity and then in a separate decision acts ethically and humanely like a neighbor, not an enemy.

Thus, the altruistic person must frequently deal with overcoming empathic distress – that is, a too intensely felt experience of the other’s pain that goes beyond a vicarious experience of pain and becomes the individual’s own pain pure-and-simple (Hoffman 2000: 87-8). Empathic distress can become so intense that one tries to flee from the situation rather than engaging other alternatives such as helping. Under this interpretation, instead of just being hard-hearted (which remains a possibility in principle), empathic distress is what happened to the first two would-be helpers who passed by the victim/traveler, crossing the road due to this empathic distress in order to put distance between themselves and the source of suffering.

However, one may object, does this not raise the bar too high on altruism? Altruism occasions a triple pain. It now produces three episodes of pain – first the initial distress (for example) of traveler waylaid and beaten by robbers; second, the vicarious experience of the victim’s pain as experienced by the would-be Good Samaritan; and finally the sacrifice (pain) incurred by the Samaritan in aiding the victim. Of course, if successful, altruism eliminates the initial suffering of the victim and by implication the vicarious pain in which the Good Samaritan is empathically connected to the target of altruism. This leaves altruism only with whatever pain is caused by the cost and effort incurred in aiding the victim. In contrast, empathy is left with the initial suffering, the vicarious experience of pain, and the question of what, if anything, to do about the suffering disclosed by one’s empathy. Of course, one possible answer is to act altruistically. Alternatively, one could also simply cross over - cross the road - and pass by. Thus, in answer to the objection that this analysis through empathy sets the bar too high for altruism, the answer is direct. Altruism is indeed a high bar; but one which we are challenged by and, with ethical effort, able to surmount. Empathy tells us what the other is experiencing; altruism what to do about it.

4. The Continental Tradition

The Anglo-American and Continental traditions (neither of which is homogeneous in themselves) have enjoyed an expanding exchange of views in comparison with past periods when each tradition tended to maintain its own island of ideas. Still, the Continental tradition has its own voice and views on empathy and ethics. Three topics have arguably have been the target of a more dedicated inquiry from the Continental side: Nietzsche’s empathic sense of smell as a compliment to his philosophy of suspicion, especially in On the Genealogy of Morals (1887); the Holocaust, especially as interpreted by Hannah Arendt; and the role of the Other (with a capital “O”), especially in Levinas (1961). None of these topics are exclusively the domain of Continental thinking, but are rather invoked here as witnesses of a distinctly Continental contribution.

a. Nietzsche’s Empathy of Smell Complements His Suspicion

Although the word “Einfühlung” does not occur in Nietzsche, his approach is arguably an empathic one, especially as empathy activates the primitive sense of smell. Nietzsche’s status as an outsider, as an individual of the limit experience (Grenzerfahrung), informs his sense of smell – and his empathy - with the dynamics of moral sentimentalism in a fundamental way. Nietzsche’s empathy informs his suspicion time-and-again. Empathy functions as a complement to the method of suspicion. Nietzsche feels – and smells – more acutely and distinctly than the various persons that are intermittently the target of his debunking – the scholar (scientist), artist, priest, last man, the mass (herd) man, even the higher man. For example, behind the moral prescription of “love of one’s neighbor” lies the ascetic priest’s antidote to depression, namely, the performance of petty pleasures of doing (minor) acts of kindness to those who are less fortunate. Nietzsche’s empathy detects the petty pleasure as a trace affect, which, in turn, feeds his suspicion. Nietzsche detects the will to power in a cautious dose of the petty pleasure of doing a good deed that costs the doer nothing and benefits the recipient equally little, but has the result of disclosing a happiness of “slight superiority” (1887: Third Essay, Section 18).

For Nietzsche, the sense of smell functions empathically in disclosing a mostly unsuspected trace of weariness. Suspicion is frequently called out as being essential to Nietzsche’s debunking of established bourgeois morals and iconoclasm towards cherished values. Christian ethics, the love of Saint Paul (“agape”), and their implementation by the Church of Rome, are not what they seem to be according to the Christian account. Once called out, Nietzsche experiences what Hoffman calls “empathic distress” at the leveling and mediocrity from which contemporary man suffers - the emptiness, apathy, malaise, and depression - in short, the nihilism of which the average man is mostly unaware but from which he too suffers. However, Nietzsche does not take the next step to “sympathetic distress” (Hoffman 2000: 87-8). Instead this underlying suffering is transmitted via emotional contagion through the sense of smell as further input to Nietzsche’s empathic processing: “Bad air, bad air! The approach of some ill-constituted thing, that I have to smell the entrails of some ill-constituted soul” (1887: First Essay, Section 11).  Behind the Christian love of the “meek that inherit the earth” Nietzsche’s empathy discovers a trace affect of ressentiment; behind the anti-Semitism of the Church of Rome lies the vengefulness and hatred of slave morality. What passes for virtue is lack of opportunity for badness. Undertaking an inquiry into the formation of ideals such as the Christian “Last Judgment,” “the Kingdom of Heaven,” and [Christian] “faith, hope, and love,” using his empathy, Nietzsche discovers an empathic trace affect of “the intoxication of sweet revenge.” His suspicion then uses these traces to unmask pretensions. All the while, rhetorically exclaiming, “I’ll open my ears again (Oh! Oh! Oh! And close my nose)” (1887: First Essay, Section 14).

Nietzsche’s empathic debunking continues. He quotes from Dante and the Church Father Tertullian that the pleasures of the blessed in heaven will be enhanced by watching from above the tortures of those who are damned in Hell. Not empathy but rather what has come to be called, even in English, “Schadenfreude” - an enjoyment (Freude) at the damages (Schaden) being done to another. Yet even Schadenfreude implies an empathic communication of affect, since the observer’s enjoyment is enhanced by a deep grasp of the suffering of the damned, an appreciation enhanced by a trace affect of the suffering. However, the relationship of Schadenfreude to empathy is one of reactive antipathy. Schaenfreude like sympathy is reactive. In addition to the communication of affect, it includes a response to what is transmitted. Instead of approval or disapproval as in the case of sympathy, the response in Schadenfreud is one of enjoyment at the suffering of the other.

Bad conscience (guilt) seems like a mark of advancing civilization. However, suspicion fulfilled by empathy discloses otherwise. “Bad conscience” is an illness. The more advanced the civilization, the more advanced the guilt. This illness (bad conscience) is hostility, cruelty, destructiveness turned against oneself. This causes “the gravest and uncanniest illness, from which humanity has not yet recovered, man’s suffering of man” (1887: Essay Two, Section 16).

Individuals who escape bad conscience are rare. We can at least envision the possibility in figures in literature such as Achilles, Faust, or Nietzsche’s own cipher Zarathustra, the latter in his better moments of recovery from the great contempt. Nietzsche drives forward his empathic inquiry into the suffering of modern persons and their ideals by a debunking of ascetic ideals. Following his nose – and his empathy – Nietzsche calls again, “And therefore let us have fresh air! fresh air! And keep clear of the madhouse and hospitals of culture!” (1887: Third Essay, Section 14). The result? The priest does not discharge the ressentiment of the modern mass of men, leading their lives of silent desperation and suffering; rather the priest alters the direction of the ressentiment and turns it against the individual: “This is brazen and false enough: but one thing at least is achieved by it, the direction of ressentiment is altered” (1887: Third Essay, Section 16). In conclusion, using a suspicion informed by empathy, Nietzsche famously asserts the position: man would rather will nothing than not will, setting the stage for nihilism. Nietzsche’s empathy points to hidden (and not so hidden) suffering in unexpected places – art, science, religion, philosophy, and, above all, morals. However, in every case, a pattern emerges. Empathy complemented by suspicion shows that it is not so much suffering that man dreads as suffering’s meaninglessness. Thus, ascetic ideals give meaning to man’s suffering by holding out asceticism as a path to something higher. However, some events defy both suffering and meaning and leave us numb, like a deer in the headlights.  We now turn to one such event.

b. The Challenge to Empathy of the Event of the Holocaust

The Holocaust represents a challenge to our empathy as we try to grasp the meaning of historic event from afar in anguished, benumbed remembrance. We can grasp the killing of a single individual as a crime and the killing of many as an even more serious crime. We are challenged to grasp the mutual slaughter of armies on fields of battle in the bloodbath known as “history,” but tentatively rise to the occasion as in Tolstoy’s account of the Battle of Borodino, Crane’s The Red Badge of Courage, or even Boden’s Black Hawk Down. But the systematic, bureaucratized, automated destruction of the Jewish population of Europe by the Nazis between 1938 and 1945 is a challenge to our empathy for so many reasons. It remains one of the defining events of post modern ethics. If we cannot empathize with it, we cannot imagine it. If we cannot imagine it, we cannot punish it. If we cannot punish it, we cannot forgive it. We are burdened with it in a way that defines, chokes, and diminishes our humanity. We are stuck with it in a way that defines, chokes, and diminishes what is possible for human beings; but in the face of which we have to go forward into possibility nonetheless.  It is important to note this was accompanied by and included the extrajudicial killing of other “life unworthy of life” such as the mentally ill and retarded, gypsies, gays, communists, uncooperative members of other religious and political parties. However, the racial laws and anti-Semitic ideology that specifically preceded the event, targeting Jewish people, make it their Holocaust in a special and unhappy way.

Grasping these ideas require putting one’s thoughts and sensibility in a place that they usually do not venture. In the early days of World War II and prior to the automation of killing in the death factories such as Auschwitz, it was difficult for soldiers and paramilitaries to kill people for eight hours a day by shooting them. However, continuous killing is what was required of the Nazis soldiers when there are so many people to kill. That was what the so-called special intervention groups [Einsatzgruppen] had to do. In addition, it is difficult to watch people suffering over so long a period of time, especially if you have insufficient bullets to shoot or gas them all immediately. This is a challenge for any approach to genocide, even after the intended victims have been marked with a yellow star or otherwise “branded,” equated with vermin, insects, and dehumanized. On the street, people still look like humans when we confront them face-to-face or even face-to-back. The misuse of the Nazi concept of duty, which only superficially resembles a deontological one, has been often noted. It occurs again here and should never be mentioned without being challenged. Briefly, the fallacy consists in making an exception for a subset of humans, thus contradicting one’s own humanness. Even formally, the good Nazi morally contradicts himself – a consistency in shooting only one or a few types of persons (in addition to Jews - gypsies, communists, Catholic converts, gays, mentally retarded, physically disabled – the list grows tellingly) – is inconsistency pure-and-simple. Arendt is worth quoting at length:

. . . The murders were not sadists or killers by nature; on the contrary, a systematic effort was made to weed out all those who derived physical pleasure from what they did. The troops of the Einsatzgruppen [responsible for shooting] had been drafted from the Armed S.S., a military unit with hardly more crimes in its record than any ordinary unit of the German Army, and their commanders had been chosen by [Chief Commander] Heydrich from the S.S. elite with academic degrees. Hence the problem was how to overcome not so much their conscience as the animal pity by which all normal men are affected in the presence of physical suffering. The trick used by Himmler – who apparently was rather strongly afflicted with these instinctive reasons himself – was very simple and probably very effective; it consisted in turning these instincts around, as it were, in directing them toward the self. So that instead of saying: What horrible things I did to people! the murderers would be able to say: What horrible things I had to watch in the pursuance of my duties, how heavily the task weighed upon my shoulders (Arendt 1971: 105-6).

While life is filled with moral ambiguities and difficult ethical choices, this is hardly one of them. What was done was wrong and to be condemned in the strongest terms. Nor is lack of empathy what represents the moral problem. It is the killing.

What made it easier for the soldiers to do their “duty” – commit murder (genocide) – was the manipulation by the leaders to deflect the individual soldier’s natural empathy for the prisoner and to increase the soldier’s empathy for himself, deflecting the natural trajectory towards the other. The “animal pity” and “instinctive reasons” against killing humans are an incomplete form of empathy, based in a mechanism like emotional contagion. In Emile, Rousseau refers to a pre-reflective sentiment of pity. “I am, so to speak, in him, it is in order not to suffer that I do not want him to suffer. I am more interested in him for love of myself, and the reason for the precept is in nature itself, which inspires in me the desire of my well-being in whatever place I feel my existence” (cited in Birmingham 2006: 42). Himmler was afflicted with what Martin L. Hoffman (2000) describes as “empathic distress.”

Without being able to engage further in the infinite sorrow and commentary invoked by the Holocaust, the relevance to empathy is direct. The issue is whether empathy can be used for harm as well as good. In invading Poland and the Netherlands in 1939 and 1940, the Nazis attached sirens to the Stuka dive bombers creating an uncanny noise that seemed to get inside the heads and hearts of the civilian population causing empathic distress. Although it may sound strange to say it, especially after reading Slote, this was based on the Nazi empathy with the victims. On the Anglo-American side, Slote’s reply is that this is not “fully developed empathic concern”. Indeed it is not.

One might try to turn such an example in the direction of an ethics of caring based on empathy by saying in effect, “Look at how fundamental empathy is.” This is accurate. However, what is missing from such a turning is use of empathy separately from its ethically informed application.

The maneuver of the Nazi (or individual psychopathic criminal) of “getting inside someone’s head” is different than being distressed by what distresses him. At the very least, the latter requires a communicability of affect or emotional contagion. Nazis and psychopaths are believed to be able to “get into your head,” but arguably they are noticeably lacking in empathy. They are also thought to lack a conscience (or at least a properly developed one), so an appeal to the example of the psychopath may not be decisive. The variables of missing empathy and missing conscience inevitably confound one another.

Such examples as psychopaths and Nazis allegedly using empathy point in the direction of multiple empathic phenomena such as emotional contagion, gut reactions, and primal pity, that are not empathy pure-and-simple but rely on the same somatic and semantic functions. The distinction between the psychopath or Nazi “getting inside one’s head” and being empathic is a fine one. Like other “diseases” of empathy such as autism, the behavior and motivations lie along a continuum between extremes. At one extreme, empathy is conspicuous by its absence. At the other extreme, low level empathic functioning is in evidence as emotional contagion along with and aspects of pathological (or criminal) behavior in a high functioning, educated individual, who also enjoys aspects of normal empathy.

The anti-foundationalist argument asserts that empathy – whether fully developed or not - does not supply its own ethical application. Empathy does not supply its own ethical justification. Empathy does indeed supply the otherness of the other – simply stated, the other. It is a separate step to care for the other, say, altruistically, or not care for the other. The empathy provides me access to the suffering of the other. It is a further step to take action to reduce that suffering in line with one’s conscience and other ethical conditions and qualifications.

Thus, the supposedly empathic Nazi spends the day shooting the helpless enemies of the Aryan race and feels a full measure of suffering (of the victims), because his mirror neurons are working normally; but instead of saying “Look how they suffer” says “Look how hard my work is – look how much I suffer.” The fall back position for the Anglo-American philosopher such as Slote is to argue that “full, adult human empathy” requires an education (along the lines of Hoffman’s inductive discipline) that leads one to experience strongly with the distress of others. Such an induction of the other’s distress with one’s own results in an inhibition of deliberate harm to the other. But wait. We already have that. It’s not induction of empathy that is needed. This hypothetical Nazis is already suffering, but continues to shoot due to a defective, misguided sense of duty to the Fuhrer. He needs instruction in ethics: Killing is wrong, regardless of what the Fuhrer says. As noted above, this example is discussed by Hannah Arendt in the context of Himmler’s animal pity for his men – under one interpretation (not necessarily Arendt’s) how he provided leadership as an “empathic” Nazi (Arendt 1971a: 105-6). The counter-counter-argument is direct. It is not empathy that inhibits one’s performing harm but rather an ethical prohibition against doing so, regardless of whether one enjoys inflicting pain or not, that stops the hurtful action. In that sense, empathy doesn’t care – it tells you how the other feels – whereas ethics tells one what one ought to do about it. In the final analysis the Nazis or psychopath exemplifies a pathological, distorted, immoral use of empathy. It is a part of the possibility of empathy to be so used and abused, though human beings with integrity and character will undertake the positive development of empathy so that the misuse does not occur or is made less likely. Of course, this has the distressing implication that we are perhaps not as different from the average, everyday Nazi in regard to our empathic capacities as we might want to imagine.

c. Ethics Against Empathy in Levinas

The third contributor in the Continental tradition is Emmanuel Levinas. The paradox of Levinas and his contribution is that someone who makes a substantial contribution to engaging the Other (as with a capital “O”) still has so little to say about empathy, fellow feeling, or sympathy. In fact, nothing. Arguably, Levinas is the anti-empath; yet much of what he says can be marshaled and read as a contribution to the conversation about empathy. For Levinas, the other is radically different. This does not just “raise the bar” on empathy and make it hard; it makes it impossible.

Still, input to a process of empathy is in evidence. For Levinas, access to the other and the infinite depth of the other’s alterity is given through the other’s face. The face is a hot spot announcing the epiphany, the arrival in force, of the other. The infinity that is available in the face is the source of the ethical power of the other in making an unconditional demand on the individual to be regarded and treated ethically as under an obligation without limitation or qualification. Receptivity to the other occurs in the embodiment of the other’s transcendence in the face. The face plays a central role in announcing the other. The other, in turn, commands responsibility. The obligation and ethical demands that the other imposes on the individual are apparent to merest inspection in the face of another human being. “The epiphany of the face is ethical” (Levinas 1961: 199). The hunger, destitution, and suffering expressed in the face of the other shows up as a demand without further comment being permitted. The face puts a stop to my egoism, my enjoyment of the world as if the world were my oyster and only mine. In this context, the word “empathy” does not occur. Yet it is implicitly able to be conceptualized en passant as “the reduction of the other to the same by interposition of a middle and neutral term” such as “cognition of [transient] identity” (1961: 43). In contrast, “we name this calling into question of my spontaneity by the presence of the other ethics” (1961: 43).

To give meaning to one’s presence is an event irreducible to evidence. It does not enter into intuition; it is a presence more direct than visible manifestation, and at the same time a remote presence – that of the other …. The eyes break through the mask – the language of the eyes, impossible to dissemble. The eye does not shine; it speaks. The alternative of truth and lying, of sincerity and dissimulation, is the prerogative of him who abides in the relation of absolute frankness, in the absolute frankness which cannot hide itself (1961: 66).

From this perspective, it is ethics against empathy. The key term here is “absolute”. The other, the face – in this passage, the eye(s) - embody the absolute. The absolute points toward and includes the infinity that is constantly in play in Totality and Infinity. In contrast, empathy totalizes the self and the other in providing evidence as a trace affect of how the self and the other are similar or even transiently identified; whereas ethics requires the other as a radically other, infinitely other, ethical demand. Yet the reader cannot help but suspect that there is an enlarged sense of empathy beyond the specific intentionality of apprehending in evidence what another feels because I feel it too. Empathy provides evidence of the other in that I know what you feel, because I feel it too, at least as a trace affect. The face is also a “hot spot” of empathic clues and receptivity. Yet, for Levinas, evidence of the other would be the ethically irrelevant, toy problem of other minds in (merely) academic philosophy. In empathy, the self and other form (or would form) a totality; but the ipseity (the self) of the I and the other go beyond totality into the infinity of absolute separation and difference in which the self and other are infinitely incommensurable. From this perspective, empathy is a regression to intentional phenomenology, a regression to Heideggerian care, a regression to inauthenticity. An attempt to reconcile the tension between empathy and the other in Levinas argues that empathy, even as a method of gathering evidence, contains at its core an irreducible respect for the other and the other’s demand that, independent of approval or disapproval, recognizes the other’s infinite authority to block my arbitrary actions towards her or him.

The one is about to lie to the other or kill the other over some trivial (or grand) matter, but is stopped up short by the recognition that one would be killing a type (though not a token) of oneself. The contingent matter of fact of nature is then institutionalized, codified, and canonized into an obligation. “Thou shalt not kill, lie, steal” and so on. The obligation is now established. However, the step from a “stopped up short” to an obligatory “Thou shalt not. . . ” is contingent and problematic. As long as the affects (and so on) disclosed through empathy are such as to support the demand of the other and of one’s obligation to the other, then we are on firm ground. However, when the demand fails or is manipulated by advertising, social pressure, or propaganda to disqualify the other and reduce the other into an subhuman entity prior to extra-judicial execution, then the lack of an ethical (moral) criterion independent of affects is sorely missed. It is necessary to transform one’s empathic distress, experiencing the suffering of the other vicariously, into a sympathetic distress that engages the aspect of feeling sorry for the other, resulting in pro-social intervention to assist the other (Hoffman 2000: 87-8). No man (individual) is an island, and narrow self-interest is readily subordinated to the imperative to reduce suffering in the world includes both the self and other on the list of agents without necessarily giving one or the other priority.

5. Empathy in the Context of Psychoanalysis and Ethics

The psychoanalyst Heinz Kohut defines empathy as the primary method of data gathering about other human beings in the discipline of psychoanalysis.  Thus, Kohut writes: “Empathy does indeed in essence define the field of our observations” (1977: 306). He offers the resonant image of empathy being the oxygen within which the developing child lives, breathes, and grows up to be a healthy human being, and, in turn, in which the adult flourishes in his or her relationships in love and work. Tactically, empathy is a method of data gathering about what is going on with the other person, and without empathy one’s appreciation of the other is incomplete. Strategically, the empathy of the other person is that which humanizes the individual, and when one individual loses the other, the individual is left apathetic, lethargic, feeling lifeless, depressed. Empathy is the oxygen breathing life into the relationship between individual and other, a metaphor introduced by Heinz Kohut (1977) without, however, Kohut extending it to the ethical dimension. In the contemporary Continental tradition, such an extension of empathy is left to Larry Hatab and John Riker, who note that empathy is a primal existential condition that makes ethical life possible (Hatab 2000; Riker 2010). Such an approach, for example, limits that of Slote, Hume, and Smith, whose use of empathy (sympathy) does indeed overlap extensively with fellow feeling in the sense of the communicability of affect yet also is extended to encompass an essential aspect of approbation or disapprobation (and the primary “warmth” (Slote 2010)) of the other’s heartfelt attitude and sentiment.

Empathy is foundational for psychoanalysis, or, more precisely, Kohut’s version of psychoanalysis that has also come to be called “self psychology”. With insufficient, misdirected, or distorted empathy, the growing, developing person (child) is incomplete. In severe cases of lack of empathy the result is hospitalism (Spitz 1946), profound emotional detachment and lack of connectivity similar to infantile autism. In cases of less severe but still traumatic failures of empathy in parent-child relatedness, the results are defects of the self, similar to but not reducible to character disorders, displaying features of narcissistic grandiosity or the seemingly compulsive pursuit of materialistic ideals of status, stuff, and the conventional success of the inauthentic mass man. The social malaise spreads, displaying ethical failings from road rage to children demanding the latest stuff to school yard bullying, precipitating suicide. Getting something for nothing, inner emptiness, immature grandiosity, and fragile self-esteem are characteristic of disorders of the self, resulting from defective and incomplete empathy (Riker 2010: 15-18). Lack of self-regulation is expressed as the numbers of people who are overweight reaches epidemic proportions, psychiatric sedatives and mood stabilizers (that is, drugs) are a growth industry in avoiding ethical responsibility and the (imperfect) duties of developing one’s talents. Addictions and chronic over-indulgence in alcohol, gambling, sex, recreational (illegal) drugs, and rampant cheating on everything from school testing to income tax to faithlessness to one’s spouse express an unhealthy sense of entitlement. Individuals strive to bandage over the pervasive feelings of inner emptiness and feelings of being a fake in spite of the external trappings of material success. The resulting image is a Nietzschian one – everywhere fragments of persons and no where a complete, whole human being, capable of engaging life with integrity (wholeness). The antidote is empathy. Empathy functions as an on-going process of distinguishing, sustaining, and strengthening the structure of the self.

Paradoxically, the structure of the self is distinguished, sustained, and maintained through failures of empathy, but failures in a phase appropriate, non-traumatic context that enable growth and development going forward. In itself, empathy provides symptom relief to emotional upset and behavioral acting out with drugs or sex, which, as symptom relief, does not last over the long run. Empathy comes into its own when, in an on-going empathic relationship, empathy breaks down and fails in a phase-appropriate, non-traumatic way. These non-traumatic failures of empathy occur within a context of successful empathy that lays down and builds psychic structure in the self. This structure enables the individual to deal with the slings and arrows of outrageous fortune, as setbacks, breakdowns, defeats as well as accomplishments inevitably arise in the course of life. Empathy becomes the foundation of an ethics of excellence through its contribution to the development of the self.

Empathy heals the self, and a well-integrated self is one able to sustain the commitments required to keep one’s word, avoid cheating and self medication with alcohol and recreational drugs, productively engage in satisfying activities and relatedness to others, and contribute to the community.

Empathy is a form of receptivity to the other; it is also a form of understanding. In the latter case, one puts oneself in the place of the other conceptually. In the former, one is open experientially to the affects, sensations, emotions that the other experiences. Undertaking an ethical inquiry without empathy – sensitivity to what is happening to and with the other – would be like engaging in an epistemological inquiry without drawing on the resources of perception. Thus, empathy is a method of access as well as a foundational structure as such.

6. A Common Root of Empathy and Ethics

In the final analysis, morality is separate from empathy and neither necessarily grounds the other, although arguably both point to a common root in human beings as the source of possibility. It will not be practical to argue here at this late point whether humans are intrinsically good or evil. Human beings are intrinsically human. Here “human” means intrinsic possibility. Human possibilities include both good and evil as well as empathy. The evidence provided by the history of the 20th century is not encouraging, yet it is not too late to turn it around as regards the present and future of humanity. Humans are also capable of great good works as demonstrated in the agricultural revolution of high yield grains that ended hunger for decades, medical “miracles” such as the eradication of small pox and other diseases, which saved many, many millions of lives. No doubt, cynics will find a flaw in every accomplishment and assure that no good deed goes unpunished. Indeed the consequence of our actions often escape us; and the propagation of forgiveness is an innovation and recommendation well counseled (Arendt 1926/65, 1971; Tutu 1999). Likewise, it is a part of the possibility of empathy to be so used and abused, although humans with integrity and character will undertake the positive development of full, adult empathy so that the misuse does not occur or is made less likely.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Lou Agosta. (1984). “Empathy and intersubjectivity,” Empathy I, ed. J. Lichtenberg et al. Hillsdale, NJ: Lawrence Erlbaum Press.
    • Engages the implicit transcendental argument that empathy is the foundation of intersubjectivity (community).
  • Lou Agosta. (2010). Empathy in the Context of Philosophy. London: Palgrave. Lou Agosta. (2010). Empathy in the Context of Philosophy. London: Palgrave.
    • A hermeneutic account of empathy, extending it by means of Heidegger (hermeneutics), Husserl (phenomenology), Searle (language analysis), and Kohut (self psychology).
  • Aristotle, “On dreams,” Loeb Classical Library: Aristotle VIII: On the Soul, Parva Naturalia, On Breath, tr. W.S. Hett. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1936.
    • The first reference to ‘empathesteros’ in the tradition.
  • Hannah Arendt. (1926/65). Love and Saint Augustine. University of Chicago Press, 1996.
  • Hannah Arendt. (1971). Eichmann in Jerusalem. New York: Viking Press.
    • Input to the debate whether Himmler’s (Nazi) “animal pity” rises to the level of empathy and if so, so what?
  • John L. Austin. (1946). “Other Minds,” Classics in Analytic Philosophy, ed. R.R. Ammerman. New York: McGraw-Hill, 1965: 353-78.
    • Footnote about a “counter-part feeling” that sounds like the vicarious aspect of empathy.
  • Bruno Bettelheim. (1974). A Home for the Heart. New York: Bantam Paperback, 1975.
    • Many uses of empathy in the context of milieu therapy, informed empathically by Bettelheim’s survival of the Nazi concentration camps.
  • Simon Baron-Cohen. (1995). Mindblindness: An Essay on Autism and Theory of Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1997.
    • Extensive use of “false belief” experiments in zeroing in on diseases of empathy such as autism; empathy (absent) as a form of “mindblindness.”
  • Michael F. Basch. (1983). “Empathic understanding: a review of the concept and some theoretical considerations,” Journal of the American Psychoanalytic Association, Vol. 31, No. 1: 101-126.
    • A foundation for psychoanalysis in affective dynamics (empathy) separate from libido and drives.
  • Peg Birmingham. (2006) Hannah Arendt and Human Rights: The Predicament of Common Responsibility. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Kaj Björkqvist. (2007). “Empathy, social intelligence and aggression in adolescent boys and girls,” Empathy in Mental Illness, T. Farrow and P. Woodruff, eds. Cambridge UK: Cambridge University Press.
    • Training (induction) in empathy reduces aggression.
  • Michael Boylan. (2008). The Good, the True and the Beautiful. New York: Continuum Books.
    • Uses sympathy to ground an account of the affective good will.
  • Ted Cohen. (2008). Thinking of Others: On the Talent for Metaphor. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 2008.
    • The capacity for metaphor (arguably) underlies the capacity for empathy (that is, thinking of others).
  • Stephen Darwall. (2006). The Second-Person Standpoint: Morality, Respect and Accountability. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • A linguistic-grammatically informed version of the struggle for recognition (without endorsing Hegel) that you should not hurt me.
  • Stephen Darwall. (1995) The British Moralists and the Internal ‘Ought’: 1640 – 1740. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
    • A monumental study, arguing (among other things) that Hume goes beyond sympathy (and moral sentimentalism) to rule-regulation.
  • Charles Darwin. (1872). The Expression of the Emotions in Man and Animals. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1965.
    • Basic emotions are continuous, arguably due to shared physiological (evolutionary) infrastructure, between man and animals.
  • Frans de Waal. (2009). The Age of Empathy. New York: Harmony Press.
    • Empathy with higher mammals breaks through to the general reading market.
  • J. Decety and T. Chaminade. (2003). “When the self represents the other: A new cognitive neuroscience view on psychological identification,” Consciousness and Cognition 12 (2003).
    • Has a fMRI machine and knows how to use it to study empathy.
  • J. Decety & P.L. Jackson. (2004). “The functional architecture of human empathy,” Behavioral and Cognitive Neuroscience Reviews, Vol 3, No. 2, June 2004, 71-100.
    • One of the most robust definitions of empathy in the literature.
  • J. Decety & C. Lamm. (2006). “Human empathy through the lens of social neuroscience,” The ScientificWorld Journal 6 (2006), 1146-1163.
    • Just as the title says.
  • M. A. Diego and N. A. Jones. (2007). “Neonatal antecedents for empathy,” Empathy in Mental Illness, T. Farrow and P. Woodruff, eds. Cambridge UK: Cambridge University Press.
    • Without empathy, the infant is damaged emotionally and behaviorally, resulting in autistic- and psychotic-like symptoms.
  • M. A. Diego and N. A. Jones. (2003). Emotions Revealed: Recognizing Faces and Feelings to Improve Communication and Emotional Life. New York: Henry Holt.
    • Same as Ekman below.
  • Paul Ekman. (1985). Telling Lies: Clues to Deceit in the Marketplace, Politics, and Marriage. New York, W.W. Norton.
    • Develops the idea of micro-expressions betraying otherwise hidden affects, which are relevant inputs to further empathic processing (the latter not discussed by Ekman). Should be read along with Hume.
  • T. Farrow and P. Woodruff, eds. (2007). Empathy in Mental Illness. Cambridge UK: Cambridge University Press.
    • Diseases of (absent) empathy such as autism, psycho-pathy, hospitalism; the neurological infrastructure in mirror neurons, extending to philosophy.
  • S. Freud. (date unknown). The Standard Edition of Freud’s Works, tr. under the supervision of James Strachey, 24 volumes. London: Hogard Press, 1955-64.
  • S. Freud. (1909). Jokes and their Relation to the Unconscious, tr. J. Strachey. New York: W. W. Norton, 1960.
    • Most of the occurrences of Einfühlung” [empathy] in Freud occur in this work, which explicitly references Lipps, who Freud owned and marked.
  • Michael N. Forster. (2010). After Herder: Philosophy of Language in the German Tradition. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Herder applies “Einfühlung” [empathy] to understanding difficult texts and interpretations, obtaining clear priority in publication over Lipps and other users of the concept.
  • Vittorio Gallese. (2007). “The shared manifold hypothesis: Embodied simulation and its role in empathy and social cognition,” Empathy in Mental Illness, eds. Tom Farrow and Peter Woodruff, Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
    • Argues for a shared (empathic) manifold based on mirror neurons.
  • Arnold Goldberg. (1999). Being of two Minds: The Vertical Split in Psychoanalysis and Psychotherapy. Hillsdale, NJ: The Analytic Press.
    • Examples of empathy based on immersion in listening to the other.
  • Pat Greenspan. (1980). “A case of mixed feelings: ambivalence and the logic of emotion,” Explaining Emotions, ed., A. O. Rorty. Berkeley: University of California Press.
    • Ambivalent feelings happen, requiring revising our understanding of consistency and rationality.
  • Ralph R. Greenson. (1960). “Empathy and its vicissitudes,” International Journal of Psychoanalysis 41 (1960): 418-24.
    • Empathy as building a model of the other and using it to capture the other.
  • H. Hartmann. (1959). “Psychoanalysis as a scientific theory.” Psychoanalysis, Scientific Method, and Philosophy: A Symposium, ed. S. Hook. New York: New York University Press, 1964: 3-37.
    • This is the philosophy of science being debated at the time that Heinz Kohut was writing his first empathy article (Kohut 1959).
  • Lawrence J. Hatab. (2000). Ethics and Finitude: Heideggerian Contributions to Moral Philosophy. Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield.
    • Contains a chapter on empathy and engages empathy on the critical path of the existential foundation of ethics.
  • Elaine Hatfield, John T. Cacioppo, Richard L. Rapson . (1994). Emotional Contagion. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
    • Emotional contagion is input to affective processing by empathy (the latter not otherwise engaged).
  • Martin Heidegger. (1927). Sein und Zeit. Tübingen: Max Niemeyer, 1972.
    • See below.
  • Martin Heidegger. (1927). Being and Time, tr. J. Stambaugh. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1996.
  • Martin Heidegger. (1927). Being and Time, trs. J. Macquarrie and E. Robinson. New York: Harper and Row, 1962.
    • Two references to “a special hermeneutic of empathy [Einfühlung]” as part of engagement (and dismissal) of Scheler and Stein; a significant indirect contribution to empathy.
  • Johann Gottfried von Herder. (1772/1792). Philosophical Writings, tr. and ed. M. N. Forster. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
    • Applies Einfühlung” [empathy] to understanding difficult texts and interpretations, obtaining clear priority in publication over Lipps.
  • Martin L. Hoffman. (2000). Empathy and Moral Development: Implications for Caring and Justice. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
    • Rich engagement with moral issues, distinguishing empathic distress and sympathetic distress.
  • David Hume. (1739). A Treatise of Human Nature, ed. L. A. Selby-Bigge (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1973).
    • Above “SBN” refers to the Selby-Bigge edition and “T” refers to the Chapter, section, and paragraph in the Clarendon edition text. Many meanings of “sympathy” as engaged herein.
  • David Hume. (1739/1904). Ein Traktat über die menschliche Natur in 2 Bänden, tr. Theodor Lipps. Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag, 1904/06.
    • The point where Lipps (1903) was enlightened about the relevance of empathy to taste and beauty.
  • David Hume, “Of the delicacy of taste and passion” (1741) in Of the Standard of Taste and Other Essays, Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill: 1965.
    • Leaves a logical space for a “delicacy of sympathy” open and undeveloped.
  • David Hume, “Of the standard of taste” (1757) in Of the Standard of Taste and Other Essays, Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill: 1965.
    • The standard of taste perceives a micro impression that the ordinary person does not perceive, leaving a logical space open for an undeveloped delicacy of sympathy (that is, delicacy of empathy).
  • Edmund Husserl. (1929/35). Zur Phänomenologie der Intersubjectivität: Texte aus dem Nachlass: Dritter Teil: 1929-1935, ed. I. Kern. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1973. Husserliana XV.
    • Dozens of references to Einfühlung [empathy] as it migrates from the periphery and superstructure of intersubjectivity to the foundation of community.
  • M. Iacoboni. (2005). “Understanding others: Imitation, language, and empathy,” Perspectives on Imitation: From Neuroscience to Social Science, S. Hurly and N. Chater, eds. Vol. 1 (76-100). Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
    • Seeking a philosophical description of how mirror neurons bind us together in empathy
  • M. Iacoboni. (2007). “Existential empathy: the intimacy of self and other,” Empathy in Mental Illness, eds. Tom Farrow and Peter Woodruff, Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
  • Philip L. Jackson, Andrew N. Meltzoff, and Jean Decety. (2005). “How do we perceive the pain of others?
    • A window into the neural processes involved in empathy,” Neuroimage 24 (2005).
  • Hans H. Kögler and Karsten R. Stueber, eds. (2000). Empathy and Agency: The Problem of Understanding in the Human Sciences. Boulder, CO: Westview Press.
    • Emphasizes Verstehen.
  • Hans H. Kögler. (2000). “Empathy, dialogical self, and reflexive interpretation: The symbolic source of simulation,” Empathy and Agency: The Problem of Understanding in the Human Sciences, Hans H. Kögler and Karsten R. Stueber, eds. Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 2000.
    • As the title says.
  • Heinz Kohut. (1959). “Introspection, empathy, and psychoanalysis,” The Journal of the American Psychoanalytic Association 7: 459-83.
    • Empathy (“vicarious introspection”) as a data gathering method, defining psychoanalysis.
  • Heinz Kohut. (1966). “Forms and transformations of narcissism.” Journal of the American Psychoanalytic Association 14: 243-272.
    • Empathy is related to humor, appreciation of art, and wisdom, enhanced in working through the self (narcissism).
  • Heinz Kohut. (1971). The Analysis of the Self. New York: International Universities Press.
    • Identifies two new forms of transference and empathy in each in the context of the self.
  • Heinz Kohut. (1977). The Restoration of the Self. New York: International Universities Press.
    • Arguably the book that Kohut was trying to write in 1971, exploring the role of empathy as the oxygen in which the well-being of the self flourishes.
  • Heinz Kohut. (1984). How Does Analysis Cure? eds. A. Goldberg and P. E. Stepansky. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
    • The short answer is “empathy”; the longer answer is “phase appropriate (non traumatic) failures of empathy that get worked through in therapy.”
  • Emmanuel Levinas. (1961). Totality and Infinity: An Essay on Exteriority, tr. A. Lingis. Pittsburgh, PA: Dusquesne University Press, 2007.
    • Provides empathy against ethics with so much to say about The Other; so little, about empathy, which latter falls on the side of totality, not infinity.
  • H. G. Liddell and R. Scott. (1940). A Greek-English Lexicon.
    • Revised and augmented throughout by Sir Henry Stuart Jones with the assistance of Roderick McKenzie. Oxford. Clarendon Press. 1940.
  • T. Lipps. (1903). Aesthetik. Hamburg: Leopold Voss, 1903.
    • Einfühlung” [empathy] is engaged as the basis of the experience of beauty.
  • T. Lipps . (1909). Leitfaden der Psychologie. Leipzig: Wilhelm Engelmann Verlag, 1909.
    • "Einfühlung” [empathy] is engaged as the basis of our experience of other minds [fremden Seelen Lebens].
  • Bonnie E. Litowitz. (2007). “The second person,” Journal of the American Psychoanalytic Association, 57: 1129.
    • Distinguishes between the dialogical and dyadic contexts in which empathy flourishes.
  • Rudolf Makkreel. (1975). Dilthey: Philosopher of the Human Science. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
    • Embraces re-experiencing (nacherleben) and Verstehen rather than empathy.
  • E. Nagel. (1959). “Methodological issues in psychoanalytic theory.” Psychoanalysis, Scientific Method, and Philosophy: A Symposium, ed. S. Hook. New York: New York University Press, 1964: 38-56.
    • The philosophy of science being debated at the time that Heinz Kohut was writing his first empathy article (Kohut 1959).
  • Thomas Nagel. (1970). The Possibility of Altruism. Princeton, NJ: Princeton Paperbacks, 1978.
    • Arguably, empathy implements altruism, which is (still) possible.
  • Thomas Nagel. (1974). “On What It’s Like to Be a bat,” The Mind’s I, eds. D. R. Hofstadter & D. C. Dennett. New York: Bantam Books, 1981.
    • Empathy pushed into a footnote.
  • Friedrich Nietzsche. (1887). On the Genealogy of Morals, tr. W. Kaufmann & R. J. Hollingdale. New York: Vintage/Random House, 1969.
    • Uses empathy (but not the word) to inform his sense of smell and suspicion.
  • Frederick A. Olafson. (1998). Heidegger and the Ground of Ethics: A Study of Mitsein, Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
  • Christine Olden. (1956). “On empathy with children,” The Psychoanalytic Study of the Child 8 (1956: 111-26).
  • Eric Partridge. (1966). Origins: A Short Etymological Dictionary of Modern English, 4th Edition. New York: Macmillan, 1977.
  • Adriaan Peperzak. (1997). Beyond: The Philosophy of Emmanuel Levinas. Evanston: Northwestern University Press.
    • An introduction with so much to say about The Other and so little about empathy. The latter falls on the side of totality, not infinity; it is empathy against ethics.
  • John Rawls. (1971). A Theory of Justice. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Engages “sympathy” as part of his analysis of altruism.
  • John Riker. (2010). Why It’s Good to be Good. New York: Jason Aronson Press.
    • Self psychology (Kohut 1977, 1984), with its focus on empathy and restoring integrity to the self, addresses ethical issues such as rampant cheating, addiction, selfishness, and (unethical) narcissism.
  • Max Scheler. (1913). Zur Phänomenologie und Theorie der Sympathiegefühle in Scheler’s Späte Schriften in Gesammelte Werke, ed. Maria Scheler and Manfred Frings. Vol. 9, Bern: Francke Verlag 1976.
  • Max Scheler. (1913/22).  The Nature of Sympathy, tr. Peter Heath. Hamden: CN: Archon Books, 1970.
    • An insightful analysis of the distinction between vicarious feeling, shared feeling, and projective empathy.
  • Michael Slote. (2007). The Ethics of Care and Empathy. London: Routledge.
    • Empathic caring as a moral criterion and the moral aspects of the ethics of care.
  • Michael Slote. (2010). Moral Sentimentalism. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • A rich engagement in which empathy provides an intelligible mechanism for moral approval and disapproval, lending philosophic rigor to the mere metaphor of moral sense (and sentimentalism).
  • Adam Smith. (1759). The Theory of the Moral Sentiments. Indianapolis: Liberty Classics 1969.
    • Sympathy recruits the imagination and fellow feeling to align with a sense of (dis)approbation, defining the limits of the human (ethical) community.
  • R. A. Spitz. (1946). “Hospitalism: a follow up report.” The Psychoanalytic Study of the Child, 2: 113-117.
    • First researcher to document that without empathy (affectionate care taking), institutionalized (hospitalized) infants sustain serious emotional, behavioral damage, simulating autism and psychosis; provided significant input to B. Bettelheim.
  • Edith Stein. (1917). On the Problem of Empathy, tr. Waltraut Stein. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1970.
    • Thoroughly debunks Lipps and (arguably) taught Husserl everything he knew about empathy in Ideas II; yet fails to 'surface' a deep analysis of the underlying intentionality of the other in relation to the act of empathy.
  • Karsten R. Stueber. (2006). Rediscovering Empathy. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
    • Stueber endorses the approach of the philosopher Donald Davidson, and, if the latter had engaged empathy, he might have developed an argument similar to this one.
  • Edward B. Titchner. (1909). Lectures on the Experimental Psychology of the Thought-Processes. New York: Macmillan.
    • First translation into English of “Einfühlung” as “empathy.”
  • H. Trosman and R. Simmons. (1972). “The Freud Library,” Journal of the American Psychoanalytic Association, 21 (1973): 646-87.
    • Tracks the two dozen or so references to “Einfühlung” in Freud.
  • J.D. Trout.(2009). The Empathy Gap. New York: Viking Press.
    • Empathy falls short of reason; and reason falls short of empathy.
  • Desmond Tutu. (1999). No Future Without Forgiveness. New York: Doubleday.
  • Lauren Wispé. (1987). “History of the concept of empathy,” Empathy and its Development, N. Eisenberg & J. Strayer, eds. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • A collection of quotations.
  • Lauren Wispé. (1991). The Psychology of Sympathy. New York: Plenum Press.
    • A collection of quotations; we now know who said what and when they said it.
  • Dan Zahavi. (2005). Subjectivity and Selfhood: Investigating the First-Person Perspective. Cambridge, UK: Bradfordbook/MIT Press.
    • Lively engagement with empathy, narrative, Heidegger, Husserl, Ricoeur, and Sartre.

Author Information

Lou Agosta
U. S. A.

Care Ethics

The moral theory known as “ the ethics of care” implies that there is moral significance in the fundamental elements of relationships and dependencies in human life. Normatively, care ethics seeks to maintain relationships by contextualizing and promoting the well-being of care-givers and care-receivers in a network of social relations. Most often defined as a practice or virtue rather than a theory as such, "care" involves maintaining the world of, and meeting the needs of, ourself and others. It builds on the motivation to care for those who are dependent and vulnerable, and it is inspired by both memories of being cared for and the idealizations of self. Following in the sentimentalist tradition of moral theory, care ethics affirms the importance of caring motivation, emotion and the body in moral deliberation, as well as reasoning from particulars. One of the original works of care ethics was Milton Mayeroff’s short book, On Caring, but the emergence of care ethics as a distinct moral theory is most often attributed to the works of psychologist Carol Gilligan and philosopher Nel Noddings in the mid-1980s. Both charged traditional moral approaches with male bias, and asserted the “voice of care” as a legitimate alternative to the “justice perspective” of liberal human rights theory. Annette Baier, Virginia Held, Eva Feder Kittay, Sara Ruddick, and Joan Tronto are some of the most influential among many subsequent contributors to care ethics.

Typically contrasted with deontological/Kantian and consequentialist/utilitarian ethics, care ethics is found to have affinities with moral perspectives such as African ethics, Confucian ethics, and others. Critics fault care ethics with being a kind of slave morality, and as having serious shortcomings including essentialism, parochialism, and ambiguity. Although care ethics is not synonymous with feminist ethics, much has been written about care ethics as a feminine and feminist ethic, in relation to motherhood, international relations, and political theory. Care ethics is widely applied to a number of moral issues and ethical fields, including caring for animals and the environment, bioethics, and more recently public policy. Originally conceived as most appropriate to the private and intimate spheres of life, care ethics has branched out as a political theory and social movement aimed at broader understanding of, and public support for, care-giving activities in their breadth and variety.

Table of Contents

  1. History and Major Authors
    1. Carol Gilligan
    2. Nel Noddings
    3. Other Influential authors
      1. Annette Baier
      2. Virginia Held
      3. Eva Feder Kittay
      4. Sara Ruddick
      5. Joan Tronto
  2. Definitions of Care
  3. Criticisms
    1. Care Ethics as a Slave Morality
    2. Care Ethics as Empirically Flawed
    3. Care Ethics as Theoretically Indistinct
    4. Care Ethics as Parochial
    5. Care Ethics as Essentialist
    6. Care Ethics as Ambiguous
  4. Feminine and Feminist Ethics
  5. Relation to Other Theories
  6. Maternalism
  7. International Relations
  8. Political Theory
  9. Caring for Animals
  10. Applied Care Ethics
  11. Care Movements
  12. References and Further Reading

1. History and Major Authors

a. Carol Gilligan

While early strains of care ethics can be detected in the writings of feminist philosophers such as Mary Wollstonecraft, Catherine and Harriet Beecher, and Charlotte Perkins, it was first most explicitly articulated by Carol Gilligan and Nel Noddings in the early 1980s. While a graduate student at Harvard, Gilligan wrote her dissertation outlining a different path of moral development than the one described by Lawrence Kohlberg, her mentor. Kohlberg had posited that moral development progressively moves toward more universalized and principled thinking and had also found that girls, when later included in his studies, scored significantly lower than boys. Gilligan faulted Kohlberg’s model of moral development for being gender biased, and reported hearing a “different voice” than the voice of justice presumed in Kohlberg’s model. She found that both men and women articulated the voice of care at different times, but noted that the voice of care, without women, would nearly fall out of their studies. Refuting the charge that the moral reasoning of girls and women is immature because of its preoccupation with immediate relations, Gilligan asserted that the “care perspective” was an alternative, but equally legitimate form of moral reasoning obscured by masculine liberal justice traditions focused on autonomy and independence. She characterized this difference as one of theme, however, rather than of gender.

Gilligan articulated these thematic perspectives through the moral reasoning of “Jake” and “Amy”, two children in Kohlberg’s studies responding to the “Heinz dilemma”. In this dilemma, the children are asked whether a man, “Heinz”, should have stolen an overpriced drug to save the life of his ill wife. Jake sees the Heinz dilemma as a math problem with people wherein the right to life trumps the right to property, such that all people would reasonably judge that Heinz ought to steal the drug. Amy, on the other hand, disagrees that Heinz should steal the drug, lest he should go to prison and leave his wife in another predicament. She sees the dilemma as a narrative of relations over time, involving fractured relationships that must be mended through communication. Understanding the world as populated with networks of relationships rather than people standing alone, Amy is confident that the druggist would be willing to work with Heinz once the situation was explained. Gilligan posited that men and women often speak different languages that they think are the same, and she sought to correct the tendency to take the male perspective as the prototype for humanity in moral reasoning.

Later, Gilligan vigorously resisted readings of her work that posit care ethics as relating to gender more than theme, and even established the harmony of care and justice ethics (1986), but she never fully abandoned her thesis of an association between women and relational ethics. She further developed the idea of two distinct moral “voices”, and their relationship to gender in Mapping the Moral Domain:  A Contribution of Women’s Thinking to Psychological Theory and Education (Gilligan, Ward, and Taylor, 1988), a collection of essays that traced the predominance of the “justice perspective” within the fields of psychology and education, and the implications of the excluded “care perspective”. In Making Connections:  The Relational Worlds of Adolescent Girls at Emma Willard School, Gilligan and her co-editors argued that the time between the ages of eleven and sixteen is crucial to girls’ formation of identity, being the time when girls learn to silence their inner moral intuitions in favor of more rule bound interpretations of moral reasoning (Gilligan, Lyons, and Hamner, 1990, 3). Gilligan found that in adulthood women are encouraged to resolve the crises of adolescence by excluding themselves or others, that is, by being good/responsive, or by being selfish/independent. As a result, women’s adolescent voices of resistance become silent, and they experience a dislocation of self, mind, and body, which may be reflected in eating disorders, low leadership aspiration, and self-effacing sexual choices. Gilligan also expanded her ideas in a number of articles and reports (Gilligan, 1979; 1980; 1982; 1987).

b. Nel Noddings

In 1984 Noddings published Caring, in which she developed the idea of care as a feminine ethic, and applied it to the practice of moral education. Starting from the presumption that women “enter the practical domain of moral action…through a different door”, she ascribed to feminine ethics a preference for face-to face moral deliberation that occurs in real time, and appreciation of the uniqueness of each caring relationship. Drawing conceptually from a maternal perspective, Noddings understood caring relationships to be basic to human existence and consciousness. She identified two parties in a caring relationship—“one-caring” and the “cared-for”—and affirmed that both parties have some form of obligation to care reciprocally and meet the other morally, although not in the same manner. She characterized caring as an act of “engrossment” whereby the one-caring receives the cared-for on their own terms, resisting projection of the self onto the cared-for, and displacing selfish motives in order to act on the behalf of the cared-for. Noddings located the origin of ethical action in two motives, the human affective response that is a natural caring sentiment, and the memory of being cared-for that gives rise to an ideal self. Noddings rejected universal principles for prescribed action and judgment, arguing that care must always be contextually applied.

Noddings identified two stages of caring, “caring-for” and “caring-about”. The former stage refers to actual hands-on application of caring services, and the latter to a state of being whereby one nurtures caring ideas or intentions. She further argued that the scope of caring obligation is limited. This scope of caring is  strongest towards others who are capable of reciprocal relationship. The caring obligation is conceived of as moving outward in concentric circles so enlarged care is increasingly characterized by a diminished ability for particularity and contextual judgment, which prompted Noddings to speculate that it is impossible to care-for everyone. She maintained that while the one-caring has an obligation to care-for proximate humans and animals to the extent that they are needy and able to respond to offerings of care, there is a lesser obligation to care for distant others if there is no hope that care will be completed. These claims proved to be highly controversial, and Noddings later revised them somewhat. In her more recent book Starting From Home, Noddings endorsed a stronger obligation to care about distant humans, and affirms caring-about as an important motivational stage for inspiring local and global justice, but continued to hold that it is impossible to care-for all, especially distant others. (See 3a.iv below)

c. Other Influential authors

Although many philosophers have developed care ethics, five authors are especially notable.

i. Annette Baier

Annette Baier observes certain affinities between care ethics and the moral theory of David Hume, whom she dubs the “women’s moral theorist.” Baier suggests both deny that morality consists in obedience to a universal law, emphasizing rather the importance of cultivating virtuous sentimental character traits, including gentleness, agreeability, compassion, sympathy, and good temperedness (1987, 42). Baier specially underscores trust, a basic relation between particular persons, as the fundamental concept of morality, and notes its obfuscation within theories premised on abstract and autonomous agents. She recommends carving out room for the development of moral emotions and harmonizing the ideals of care and justice.

ii. Virginia Held

Virginia Held is the editor and author of many books pertaining to care ethics. In much of her work she seeks to move beyond ideals of liberal justice, arguing that they are not as much flawed as limited, and examines how social relations might be different when modeled after mothering persons and children. Premised on a fundamental non-contractual human need for care, Held construes care as the most basic moral value. In Feminist Morality (1993), Held explores the transformative power of creating new kinds of social persons, and the potentially distinct culture and politics of a society that sees as “its most important task the flourishing of children and the creation of human relationships”. She describes feminist ethics as committed to actual experience, with an emphasis on reason and emotion, literal rather than hypothetical persons, embodiment, actual dialogue, and contextual, lived methodologies. In The Ethics of Care (2006), Held demonstrates the relevance of care ethics to political, social and global questions. Conceptualizing care as a cluster of practices and values, she describes a caring person as one who has appropriate motivations to care for others and who participates adeptly in effective caring practices. She argues for limiting both market provisions for care and the need for legalistic thinking in ethics, asserting that care ethics has superior resources for dealing with the power and violence that imbues all relations, including those on the global level. Specifically, she recommends a view of a globally interdependent civil society increasingly dependent upon an array of caring NGOs for solving problems. She notes: “The small societies of family and friendship embedded in larger societies are formed by caring relations... A globalization of caring relations would help enable people of different states and cultures to live in peace, to respect each others’ rights, to care together for their environments, and to improve the lives of their children”(168). Ultimately, she argues that rights based moral theories presume a background of social connection, and that when fore-grounded, care ethics can help to create communities that promote healthy social relations, rather than the near boundless pursuit of self-interest.

iii. Eva Feder Kittay

Eva Feder Kittay is another prominent care ethicist. Her book, Women and Moral Theory (1987), co-edited with Diana T. Meyers, is one the most significant anthologies in care ethics to date. In  this work they map conceptual territory inspired by Gilligan's work, both critically and supportively, by exploring major philosophical themes such as self and autonomy, ethical principles and universality, feminist moral theory, and women and politics. In Love's Labor (1999), Kittay develops a dependency based account of equality rooted in the activity of caring for the seriously disabled. Kittay holds that the principles in egalitarian theories of justice, such as  those of John Rawls, depend upon more fundamental principles and practices of care, and that without supplementation such theories undermine themselves (108). Kittay observes that in practice some women have been able to leave behind traditional care-giving roles only because other women have filled them, but she resists the essentialist association between women and care by speaking of “dependency workers” and “dependency relations”. She argues that equality for dependency workers and the unavoidably dependent will only be achieved through conceptual and institutional reform. Employing expanded ideals of fairness and reciprocity that take interdependence as basic, Kittay poses a third principle for Rawls' theory of justice: “To each according to his or her need, from each to his or her capacity for care, and such support from social institutions as to make available resources and opportunities to those providing care” (113). She more precisely calls for the public provision of Doulas, paid professional care-workers who care for care-givers, and uses the principle of Doula to justify welfare for all care-givers, akin to worker's compensation or unemployment benefits.

iv. Sara Ruddick

Held identifies Sara Ruddick as the original pioneer of the theory of care ethics, citing Ruddick's 1980 article “Maternal Thinking” as the first articulation of a distinctly feminine approach to ethics. In this article, and in her later book of the same title (1989), Ruddick uses care ethical methodology to theorize from the lived experience of mothering, rendering a unique approach to moral reasoning and a ground for a feminist politics of peace. Ruddick explains how the practices of “maternal persons” (who may be men or women), exhibit cognitive capacities or conceptions of virtue with larger moral relevance. Ruddick's analysis, which forges strong associations between care ethics and motherhood, has been both well-received and controversial (see Section 6, below).

v. Joan Tronto

Joan Tronto is most known for exploring the intersections of care ethics, feminist theory, and political science. She sanctions a feminist care ethic designed to thwart the accretion of power to the existing powerful, and to increase value for activities that legitimize shared power. She identifies moral boundaries that have served to privatize the implications of care ethics, and highlights the political dynamics of care relations which describe, for example, the tendency of women and other minorities to perform care work in ways that benefit the social elite. She expands the phases of care to include “caring about”, “taking care of” (assuming responsibility for care), “care-giving” (the direct meeting of need), and “care-receiving”. She coins the phrase “privileged irresponsibility” to describe the phenomenon that allows the most advantaged in society to purchase caring services, delegate the work of care-giving, and avoid responsibility for the adequacy of hands-on care. (See Sections 2 and 8 below).

2. Definitions of Care

Because it depends upon contextual considerations, care is notoriously difficult to define. As Ruddick points out, at least three distinct but overlapping meanings of care have emerged in recent decades—an ethic defined in opposition to justice, a kind of labor, and a particular relationship (1998, 4). However, in care ethical literature, 'care' is most often defined as a practice, value, disposition, or virtue, and is frequently portrayed as an overlapping set of concepts. For example, Held notes that care is a form of labor, but also an ideal that guides normative judgment and action, and she characterizes care as “clusters” of practices and values (2006, 36, 40). One of the most popular definitions of care, offered by Tronto and Bernice Fischer, construes care as “a species of activity that includes everything we do to maintain, contain, and repair our 'world' so that we can live in it as well as possible. That world includes our bodies, ourselves, and our environment”. This definition posits care fundamentally as a practice, but Tronto further identifies four sub-elements of care that can be understood simultaneously as stages, virtuous dispositions, or goals. These sub-elements are: (1) attentiveness, a proclivity to become aware of need; (2) responsibility, a willingness to respond and take care of need; (3) competence, the skill of providing good and successful care; and (4) responsiveness, consideration of the position of others as they see it and recognition of the potential for abuse in care (1994, 126-136). Tronto's definition is praised for how it admits to cultural variation and extends care beyond family and domestic spheres, but it is also criticized for being overly broad, counting nearly every human activity as care.

Other definitions of care provide more precise delineations. Diemut Bubeck narrows the definitional scope of care by emphasizing personal interaction and dependency. She describes care as an emotional state, activity, or both, that is functional, and specifically involves “the meeting of needs of one person by another where face-to-face interaction between care and cared for is a crucial element of overall activity, and where the need is of such a nature that it cannot possibly be met by the person in need herself” (129). Bubeck thus distinguishes care from “service”, by stipulating that “care” involves meeting the needs for others who cannot meet their needs themselves, whereas “service” involves meeting the needs of individuals who are capable of self-care. She also holds that one cannot care for oneself, and that care does not require any emotional attachment. While some care ethicists accept that care need not always have an emotional component, Bubeck's definitional exclusion of self-care is rejected by other care ethicists who stress additional aspects of care.

For example, both Maurice Hamington and Daniel Engster make room for self-care in their definitions of care, but focus more precisely on special bodily features and end goals of care (Hamington, 2004; Engster, 2007). Hamington focuses on embodiment, stating that: “care denotes an approach to personal and social morality that shifts ethical considerations to context, relationships, and affective knowledge in a manner that can only be fully understood if care's embodied dimension is recognized. Care is committed to flourishing and growth of individuals, yet acknowledges our interconnectedness and interdependence” (2004, 3). Engster develops a “basic needs” approach to care, defining care as a practice that includes “everything we do to help individuals to meet their vital biological needs, develop or maintain their basic capabilities, and avoid or alleviate unnecessary or unwanted pain and suffering, so that they can survive, develop, and function in society” (2007, 28). Although care is often unpaid, interpersonal, and emotional work, Engster’s definition does not exclude paid work or self-care, nor require the presence of affection or other emotion (32). Although these definitions emphasize care as a practice, not all moral theorists maintain this view of.

Alternatively, care is understood as a virtue or motive. James Rachels, Raja Halwani, and Margaret McLaren have argued for categorizing care ethics as a species of virtue ethics, with care as a central virtue (Rachels, 1999; McLaren, 2001; Halwani, 2003). The idea that that care is best understood as virtuous motives or communicative skills is endorsed by Michael Slote who equates care with a kind of motivational attitude of empathy, and by Selma Sevenhuijsen, who defines care as “styles of situated moral reasoning” that involves listening and responding to others on their own terms.” (Slote, 2007; Sevenhuijsen, 1998, 85).

Some ethicists prefer to understand care as a practice more fundamental than a virtue or motive because doing so resists the tendency to romanticize care as a sentiment or dispositional trait, and reveals the breadth of caring activities as globally intertwined with virtually all aspects of life. As feminist ethicists, Kittay and Held like to understand care as a practice and value rather than as a virtue because it risks “losing site of it as work” (Held, 2006, 35). Held refutes that care is best understood as a disposition such as compassion or benevolence, but defines “care” as “more a characterization of a social relation than the description of an individual disposition.”

Overall, care continues to be an essentially contested concept, containing ambiguities that Peta Bowden, finds advantageous, revealing  “the complexity and diversity of the ethical possibilities of care”(1997, 183).

3. Criticisms

A number of criticisms have been launched against care ethics, including that it is: a) a slave morality; b) empirically flawed; c) theoretically indistinct; d) parochial, e) essentialist, and f) ambiguous.

a. Care Ethics as a Slave Morality

One of the earliest objections was that care ethics is a kind of slave morality valorizing the oppression of women (Puka, 1990; Card, 1990; Davion, 1993). The concept of slave morality comes from the philosopher Frederick Nietzsche, who held that oppressed peoples tend to develop moral theories that reaffirm subservient traits as virtues. Following this tradition, the charge that care ethics is a slave morality interprets the different voice of care as emerging from patriarchal traditions characterized by rigidly enforced sexual divisions of labor. This critique issues caution against uncritically valorizing caring practices and inclinations because women who predominantly perform the work of care often do so to their own economic and political disadvantage. To the extent that care ethics encourages care without further inquiring as to who is caring for whom, and whether these relationships are just, it provides an unsatisfactory base for a fully libratory ethic. This objection further implies that the voice of care may not be an authentic or empowering expression, but a product of false consciousness that equates moral maturity with self-sacrifice and self-effacement.

b. Care Ethics as Empirically Flawed

Critics also question the empirical accuracy and validity of Gilligan’s studies. Gilligan has been faulted for basing her conclusions on too narrow a sample, and for drawing from overly homogenous groups such as students at elite colleges and women considering abortion (thereby excluding women who would not view abortion as morally permissible). It is argued that wider samples yield more diverse results and complicate  the picture of dual and gendered moral perspectives (Haan, 1976; Brabeck, 1983). For instance, Vanessa Siddle Walker and John Snarey surmise that resolution of the Heinz dilemma shifts if Heinz is identified as Black, because in the United States African-American males are disproportionately likely to be arrested for crime, and less likely to have their cases dismissed without stringent penalties (Walker and Snarey, 2004). Sandra Harding observes certain similarities between care ethics and African moralities, noting that care ethics has affinities with many other moral traditions (Harding, 1987). Sarah Lucia Hoagland identifies care as the heart of lesbian connection, but also cautions against the dangers of assuming that all care relations are ideally maternalistic (Hoagland, 1988). Thus, even if some women identify with care ethics, it is unclear whether this is a general quality of women, whether moral development is distinctly and dualistically gendered, and whether the voice of care is the only alternative moral voice. However, authors like Marilyn Friedman maintain that even if it cannot be shown that care is a distinctly female moral orientation, it is plausibly understood as a symbolically feminine approach (Friedman, 1987).

c. Care Ethics as Theoretically Indistinct

Along similar lines some critics object that care ethics is not a highly distinct moral theory, and that it rightly incorporates liberal concepts such as autonomy, equality, and justice. Some defenders of utilitarianism and deontology argue that the concerns highlighted by care ethics have been, or could be, readily addressed by existing theories (Nagl-Docekal, 1997; Ma, 2002). Others suggest that care ethics merely reduces to virtue ethics with care being one of many virtues (Rachels, 1999; Slote, 1998a; 1998b; McLaren, 2001, Halwani, 2003). Although a number of care ethicists explore the possible overlap between care ethics and other moral theories, the distinctiveness of the ethic is defended by some current advocates of care ethics, who contend that the focus on social power, identity, relationship, and interdependency are unique aspects of the theory (Sander-Staudt, 2006). Most care ethicists make room for justice concerns and for critically scrutinizing alternatives amongst justice perspectives. In some cases, care ethicists understand the perspectives of care and justice as mutual supplements to one another. Other theorists underscore the strategic potential for construing care as a right in liberal societies that place a high rhetorical value on human rights. Yet others explore the benefits of integrating care ethics with less liberal traditions of justice, such as Marxism (Bubeck, 1995).

d. Care Ethics as Parochial

Another set of criticisms center around the concern that care ethics obscures larger social dynamics and is overly parochial. These critiques aim at Noddings’ original assertion that care givers have primary obligations to proximate others over distant others (Tronto, 1995, 111-112; Robinson, 1999, 31). Critics worry that this stance privileges elite care-givers by excusing them from attending to significant differences in international standards of living and their causes. Critics also express a concern that without a broader sense of justice, care ethics may allow for cronyism and favoritism toward one’s family and friends (Friedman, 2006; Tronto, 2006). Noddings now affirms an explicit theme of justice in care ethics that resists arbitrary favoritism, and that extends to public and international domains. Yet she upholds the primacy of the domestic sphere as the originator and nurturer of justice, in the sense that the best social policies are identified, modeled, and sustained by practices in the “best families”. Other care ethicists refine Noddings' claim by emphasizing the practical and moral connections between proximate and distant relations, by affirming a principle of care for the most vulnerable on a global level, and by explicitly weaving a political component into care theory.

e. Care Ethics as Essentialist

The objection that care ethics is essentialist stems from the more general essentialist critique made by Elizabeth Spelman (1988). Following this argument, early versions of care ethics have been faulted for failing to explore the ways in which women (and others) differ from one another, and for thereby offering a uniform picture of moral development that reinforces sex stereotypes (Tronto, 1994). Critics challenge tendencies in care ethics to theorize care based on a dyadic model of a (care-giving) mother and a (care-receiving) child, on the grounds that it overly romanticizes motherhood and does not adequately represent the vast experiences of individuals (Hoagland, 1991). The charge of essentialism in care ethics highlights ways in which women and men are differently implicated in chains of care depending on variables of class, race, age, and more. Essentialism in care ethics is problematic not only because it is conceptually facile, but also because of its political implications for social justice. For example, in the United States women of color and white women are differently situated in terms of who is more likely to give and receive care, and of what degree and quality, because the least paid care workers predominantly continue to be women of color. Likewise, lesbian and heterosexual women are differently situated in being able to claim the benefits and burdens of marriage, and are not equally presumed to be fit as care-givers. Contemporary feminist care ethicists attempt to avoid essentialism by employing several strategies, including: more thoroughly illuminating the practices of care on multiple levels and from various perspectives; situating caring practices in place and time; construing care as the symbolic rather than actual voice of women; exploring the potential of care as a gender neutral activity; and being consistently mindful of perspective and privilege in the activity of moral theorizing.

f. Care Ethics as Ambiguous

Because it eschews abstract principles and decisional procedures, care ethics is often accused of being unduly ambiguous, and for failing to offer concrete guidance for ethical action (Rachels, 1999). Some care ethicists find the non-principled nature of care ethics to be overstated, noting that because a care perspective may eschew some principles does not mean that it eschews all principles entirely (Held, 1995). Principles that could be regarded as central to care ethics might pertain to the origin and basic need of care relations, the evaluation of claims of need, the obligation to care, and the scope of care distribution. On principle, it would seem, a care ethic guides the moral agent to recognize relational interdependency, care for the self and others, cultivate the skills of attention, response, respect, and completion, and maintain just and caring relationships. However, while theorists define care ethics as a theory derived from actual practices, they simultaneously resist subjectivism and moral relativism.

4. Feminine and Feminist Ethics

Because of its association with women, care ethics is often construed as a feminine ethic. Indeed, care ethics, feminine ethics, and feminist ethics are often treated as synonymous. But although they overlap, these are discrete fields in that although care ethics connotes feminine traits, not all feminine and feminist ethics are care ethics, and the necessary connection between care ethics and femininity has been subject to rigorous challenge. The idea that there may be a distinctly woman-oriented, or a feminine approach to ethics, can be traced far back in history. Attempts to legitimate this approach gained momentum in the 18th and 19th centuries, fueled by some suffragettes, who argued that granting voting rights to (white) women would lead to moral social improvements. Central assumptions of feminine ethics are that women are similar enough to share a common perspective, rooted in the biological capacity and expectation of motherhood, and that characteristically feminine traits include compassion, empathy, nurturance, and kindness.

But once it is acknowledged that women are diverse, and that some men exhibit equally strong tendencies to care, it is not readily apparent that care ethics is solely or uniquely feminine. Many women, in actuality and in myth, in both contemporary and past times, do not exhibit care. Other factors of social identity, such as ethnicity and class, have also been found to correlate with care thinking. Nonetheless, care has pervasively been assumed to be a symbolically feminine trait and perspective, and many women resonate with a care perspective. What differentiates feminine and feminist care ethics turns on the extent to which there is critical inquiry into the empirical and symbolic association between women and care, and concern for the power-related implications of this association. Alison Jaggar characterizes a feminist ethic as one which exposes masculine and other biases in moral theory, understands individual actions in the context of social practices, illuminates differences between women, provides guidance for private, public, and international issues, and treats the experiences of women respectfully, but not uncritically (Jaggar, 1991).

While most theorists agree that it is mistaken to view care ethics as a “woman's morality”, the best way to understand its relation to sex and gender is disputed. Slote develops a strictly gender neutral theory of care on the grounds that care ethics can be traced to the work of male as well as female philosophers. Engster endorses a “minimally feminist theory of care” that is largely gender neutral because he defines care as meeting needs that are more generally human. Although he acknowledges that women are disadvantaged in current caring distributions and are often socialized to value self-effacing care, his theory is feminist only in seeking to assure that the basic needs of women and girls are met and their capabilities developed.

In contrast, Held, Kittay, and Tronto draft more robust overlaps between care and feminist theory, retaining yet challenging the gender-laden associations of care with language like “mothering persons” or “dependency workers”. While cautious of the associations between care and femininity, they find it useful to tap the resources of the lived and embodied experiences of women, a common one which is the capacity to birth children. They tend to define care as a practice partially in order to stay mindful of the ongoing empirical (if misguided) associations between care and women, that must inform utopian visions of care as a gender-neutral activity and virtue. Complicating things further, individuals who are sexed as women may nonetheless gain social privilege when they exhibit certain perceived traits of the male gender, such as being unencumbered and competitive, suggesting that it is potentially as important to revalue feminine traits and activities, as it is to stress the gender-neutral potential of care ethics.

As it currently stands, care ethicists agree that women are positioned differently than men in relation to caring practices, but there is no clear consensus about the best way to theorize sex and gender in care ethics.

5. Relation to Other Theories

Care ethics originally developed as an alternative to the moral theories of Kantian deontology and Utilitarianism consequentialism, but it is thought to have affinities with numerous other moral theories, such as African ethics, David Hume’s sentimentalism, Aristotelian virtue ethics, the phenomenology of Merleau-Ponty, Levinasian ethics, and Confucianism. The most pre-dominant of these comparisons has been between care ethics and virtue ethics, to the extent that care ethics is sometimes categorized as a form of virtue ethics, with care being a central virtue. The identification of caring virtues fuels the tendency to classify care ethics as a virtue ethic, although this system of classification is not universally endorsed.

Some theorists move to integrate care and virtue ethics for strategic reasons. Slote seeks to form an alliance against traditional “masculine” moral theories like Kantianism, utilitarianism, and social contract theory (Slote, 1998). He argues that, in so doing, care ethics receives a way of treating our obligations to people we don’t know, without having to supplement it with more problematic theories of justice. McLaren posits that virtue theory provides a normative framework which care ethics lacks (McLaren, 2001). The perceived flaw in care ethics for both authors is a neglect of justice standards in how care is distributed and practiced, and a relegation of care to the private realm, which exacerbates the isolation and individualization of the burdens of care already prevalent in liberal societies. McLaren contends that virtue theory provides care ethics both with a standard of appropriateness and a normative framework: “The standard of appropriateness is the mean—a virtue is always the mean between two extremes…The normative framework stems from the definition of virtue as that which promotes human flourishing” (2001, 105). Feminist critics, however, resist this assimilation on the grounds that it may dilute the unique focus of care ethics (Held, 2006; Sander-Staudt, 2006). They are optimistic that feminist versions of care ethics can address the above concerns of justice, and doubt that virtue ethics provides the best normative framework.

Similar debates surround the comparison between care ethics and Confucianism. Philosophers note a number of similarities between care ethics and Confucian ethics, not least that both theories are often characterized as virtue ethics (Li, 1994, 2000; Lai Tao, 2000). Additional similarities are that both theories emphasize relationship as fundamental to being, eschew general principles, highlight the parent-child relation as paramount, view moral responses as properly graduated, and identify emotions such as empathy, compassion, and sensitivity as prerequisites for moral response. The most common comparison is between the concepts of care and the Confucian concept of jen/ren. Ren is often translated as love of humanity, or enlargement. Several authors argue that there is enough overlap between the concepts of care and ren to judge that care ethics and Confucian ethics are remarkably similar and compatible systems of thought (Li, 1994; Rosemont, 1997).

However, some philosophers object that it is better to view care ethics as distinct from Confucian ethics, because of their potentially incompatible aspects. Feminist care ethicists charge that a feminist care ethic is not compatible with the way Confucianism subordinates women. Ranjoo Seodu Herr locates the incompatibility as between the Confucian significance of li, or formal standards of ritual, and a feminist care ethics’ resistance to subjugation (2003). For similar reasons, Lijun Yuan doubts that Confucian ethics can ever be acceptable to contemporary feminists, despite its similarity to care ethics. Daniel Star categorizes Confucian ethics as a virtue ethic, and distinguishes virtue ethics and care ethics as involving different biases in moral perception (2002). According to Star, care ethics differs from Confucian ethics in not needing to be bound with any particular tradition, in downgrading the importance of principles (versus merely noting that principles may be revised or suspended), and in rejecting hierarchical, role-based categories of relationship in favor of contextual and particular responses.

There are also refutations of the belief that care ethics is conceptually incompatible with the justice perspectives of Kantian deontology and liberal human rights theory. Care ethicists dispute the inference that because care and justice have evolved as distinct practices and ideals, that they are incompatible. Some deny that Kantianism is as staunchly principled and rationalistic as often portrayed, and affirm that care ethics is compatible with Kantian deontology because it relies upon a universal injunction to care, and requires a principle of caring obligation. An adaptation of the Kantian categorical imperative can be used to ground the obligation to care in the universal necessity of care, and the inconsistency of willing a world without intent to care. Other theorists compare the compatibility between care ethics and concepts of central importance to a Kantian liberal tradition. Thus, Grace Clement argues that an ideal of individual autonomy is required by normative ideals of care, in the sense that care-givers ideally consent to and retain some degree of autonomy in caring relations, and also ideally foster the autonomy of care-receivers (Clement, 1996). Mona Harrington explores the significance of the liberal ideal of equality to care ethics by tracing how women’s inequality is linked to the low social valuing and provision of care work (Harrington, 2000). Other ways that Kantianism is thought to benefit care ethics is by serving as a supplementary check to caring practice, (denouncing caring relations that use others as mere means), and by providing a rhetorical vehicle for establishing care as a right.

6. Maternalism

As a theory rooted in practices of care, care ethics emerged in large part from analyses of the reasoning and activities associated with mothering. Although some critics caution against the tendency to construe all care relations in terms of a mother-child dyad, Ruddick and Held use a maternal perspective to expand care ethics as a moral and political theory. In particular, Ruddick argues that “maternal practice” yields specific kinds of thinking and supports a principled resistance to violence. Ruddick notes that while some mothers support violence and war, they should not because of how it threatens the goals and substance of care. Defining a mother as “a person who takes responsibility for children’s lives and for whom providing child care is a significant part of his or her working life”, Ruddick stipulates that both men and women can be mothers (40). She identifies the following metaphysical attitudes, cognitive capacities, and virtues associated with mothering: preservative love (work of protection with cheerfulness and humility), fostering growth (sponsoring or nurturing a child’s unfolding), and training for social acceptability (a process of socialization that requires conscience and a struggle for authenticity). Because children are subject to, but defy social expectations, the powers of mothers are limited by the “gaze of the others”. Loving attention helps mothers to perceive their children and themselves honestly so as to foster growth without retreating to fantasy or incurring loss of the self.

Expanding on the significance of the bodily experience of pregnancy and birth, Ruddick reasons that mothers should oppose a sharp division between masculinity and femininity as untrue to children’s sexual identities. In so doing, mothers should challenge the rigid division of male and female aspects characteristic of military ideology because it threatens the hope and promise of birth. Ruddick creates a feminist account of maternal care ethics that is rooted in the vulnerability, promise, and power of human bodies, and that by resisting cheery denial, can transform the symbols of motherhood into political speech.

But however useful the paradigm for mothering has been to care ethics, many find it to be a limited and problematic framework. Some critics reject Ruddick’s suggestion that mothering is logically peaceful, noting that mothering may demand violent protectiveness and fierce response. Although Ruddick acknowledges that many mothers support military endeavors and undermine peace movements, some critics are unconvinced that warfare is always illogical and universally contrary to maternal practice. Despite Ruddick's recognition of violence in mothering, others object that a motherhood paradigm offers a too narrowly dyadic and romantic paradigm, and that this approach mistakenly implies that characteristics of a mother-child relationship are universal worldly qualities of relationship. For these reasons, some care ethicists, even when in agreement over the significance of the mother-child relationship, have sought to expand the scope of care ethics by exploring other paradigms of care work, such as friendship and citizenship.

7. International Relations

Care ethics was initially viewed as having little to say about international relations. With an emphasis on known persons and particular selves, care ethics did not seem to be a moral theory suited to guide relations with distant or hostile others. Fiona Robinson challenges this idea, however, by developing a critical ethics of care that attends to the relations of dependency and vulnerability that exist on a global scale (Robinson, 1999). Robinson’s analysis expands the sentiment of care to address the inequalities within current international relations by promoting a care ethic that is responsive and attentive to the difference of others, without presuming universal homogeneity. She argues that universal principles of right and wrong typically fail to generate moral responses that alleviate the suffering of real people. But she is optimistic that a feminist phenomenological version of care ethics can do so by exploring the actual nature, conditions, and possibilities of global relations. She finds that the preoccupation with the nation state in cosmopolitanism and communitarianism, and the enforced global primacy of liberal values such as autonomy, independence, self-determination, and others, has led to a ‘culture of neglect’. This culture is girded by a systemic devaluing of interdependence, relatedness, and positive interaction with distant others. A critical ethic of care understands the global order not as emerging from a unified or homogeneous humanity, but from structures that exploit differences to exclude, marginalize and dominate. While Robinson doubts the possibility of “a more caring world” where poverty and suffering are entirely eliminated, she finds that a critical care ethic may offer an alternative mode of response that can motivate global care.

Likewise, Held is hopeful that care ethics can be used to transform international relations between states, by noticing cultural constructs of masculinity in state behaviors, and by calling for cooperative values to replace hierarchy and domination based on gender, class, race and ethnicity (Held, 2006). Care ethicists continue to explore how care ethics can be applied to international relations in the context of the global need for care and in the international supply and demand for care that is served by migrant populations of women.

8. Political Theory

As a political theory, care ethics examines questions of social justice, including the distribution of social benefits and burdens, legislation, governance, and claims of entitlement. One of the earliest explorations of the implications of care ethics for feminist political theory was in Seyla Behabib’s article “The Generalized and the Concrete Other:  The Kohlberg-Gilligan Controversy and Feminist Theory” (Benhabib, 1986). Here, Benhabib traces a basic dichotomy in political and moral theory drawn between the public and private realms. Whereas the former is thought to be the realm of justice, the social and historical, and generalized others, the latter is thought to be the realm of the good life, the natural and atemporal, and concrete others. The former is captured by the favored metaphor of social contract theory and the “state of nature”, wherein men roam as adults, alone, independent, and free from the ties of birth by women. Benhabib traces this metaphor, internalized by the male ego, within the political philosophies of Thomas Hobbes, John Locke, and John Rawls, and the moral theories of Immanuel Kant and Lawrence Kohlberg. She argues that under this conception, human interdependency, difference, and questions about private life become irrelevant to politics.

The earliest substantial account of care as a political philosophy is offered by Tronto, who identifies the traditional boundary between ethics and politics as one of three boundaries  which serves to stymie the political efficacy of a woman’s care ethic, (the other two being the boundary between the particular and abstract/impersonal moral observer, and the boundary between public and private life) (Tronto, 1993). Together, these boundaries obscure how care as a political concept illuminates the interdependency of human beings, and how care could stimulate democratic and pluralistic politics in the United States by extending a platform to the politically disenfranchised. Following Tronto, a number of feminist care ethicists explore the implications of care ethics for a variety of political concepts, including Bubeck who adapts Marxist arguments to establish the social necessity and current exploitation of the work of care; Sevenhuijsen who reformulates citizenship to be more inclusive of caring need and care work; and Kittay who develops a dependency based concept of equality (Bubeck, 1995; Sevenhuijsen, 1998; Kittay, 1999). Other authors examine the relevance of care ethics to the political issues of welfare policy, restorative justice, political agency, and global business.

The most comprehensive articulation of care ethics as a political theory is given by Engster, who defends a need based account of moral obligation (Engster, 2007). Engster’s “minimal capability theory” is formed around two major premises—that all human beings are dependent upon others to develop their basic capabilities, and that in receiving care, individuals tacitly and logically become obliged to care for others. Engster understands care as a set of practices normatively informed by three virtues: attention, responsiveness, and respect. Defining care as everything we do to satisfy vital biological needs, develop and sustain basic capabilities, and avoid unnecessary suffering, Engster applies these goals to domestic politics, economic justice, international relations, and culture. Engster holds governments and businesses responsible for offering economic provisions in times of sickness, disability, frail old age, bad luck, and reversal of fortune, for providing protection, health care, and clean environments, and for upholding the basic rights of individuals. He calls for businesses to balance caring and commodity production by making work and care more compatible, although he surmises that the goals of care need not fully subordinate economic ends such as profitability.

According to Engster, care as a political theory has universal application because conditions of dependency are ubiquitous, but care need not be practiced by all groups in the same way, and has no necessary affinities with any particular political system, including Marxism and liberalism. Governments ought to primarily care for their own populations, but should also help the citizens of other nations living under abusive or neglectful regimes, within reasonable limits. International humanitarian interventions are more obligatory than military given the risk of physical harm, and the virtues of care can help the international community avoid dangers associated with humanitarian assistance. With specific reference to cultural practices in the U.S., Engster recommends a number of policy changes to education, employment, and the media.

9. Caring for Animals

While Gilligan was relatively silent about the moral status of animals in care ethics, Noddings made it clear that humans have moral obligations only to animals which are proximate, open to caring completion, and capable of reciprocity. On these grounds she surmises that while the one-caring has a moral obligation to care for a stray cat that shows up at the door and to safely transport spiders out of the house, one is under no obligation to care for a stray rat or to become a vegetarian. She further rejects Peter Singer’s claim that it is specieist to favor humans over animals. Other care ethicists, however, such as Rita Manning, point out differences in our obligations to care for companion, domesticated, and wild animals based upon “carefully listening to the creatures who are with you in [a] concrete situation” (Manning, 1992; 1996).

The application of care ethics to the moral status of animals has been most thoroughly explored by Carol Adams and Josephine Donovan (Adams and Donovan 1996; 2007). Expanding on Adams’ original analysis of the sexual politics of meat (Adams, 1990), they maintain that a feminist care tradition offers a superior foundation for animal ethics. They specifically question whether rights theory is an adequate framework for an animal defense ethic because of its rationalist roots and individualist ontology, its tendency to extend rights to animals based on human traits, its devaluing of emotion and the body, and its preference for abstract, formal, and quantifiable rules. Alternatively, they argue that a feminist care ethic is a preferable foundation for grounding moral obligations to animals because its relational ontology acknowledges love and empathy as major bases for human-animal connections, and its contextual flexibility allows for a more nuanced consideration of animals across a continuum of difference.

Engster similarly argues that the human obligation to care for non-human animals is limited by the degree to which non-human animals are dependent upon humans (Engster, 2006). Because an obligation to care is rooted in dependency, humans do not have moral obligations to care for animals that are not dependent upon humans. However, an obligation to care for animals is established when humans make them dependent by providing food or shelter. Engster surmises that neither veganism nor vegetarianism are required providing that animals live happy, mature lives, and are humanely slaughtered, but also acknowledges that the vast majority of animals live under atrocious conditions that care ethics renounces.

Empirical studies suggest interesting differences between the way that men and women think about the moral status of animals, most notably, that women are more strongly opposed to animal research and meat eating, and report being more willing to sacrifice for these causes, than men (Eldridge and Gluck, 1996). While feminist care ethicists are careful not to take such empirical correlations as an automatic endorsement of these views, eco-feminists like Marti Kheel explicate the connection between feminism, animal advocacy, environmental ethics, and holistic health movements (Kheel, 2008). Developing a more stringent obligation to care for animals, Kheel posits the uniqueness of all animals, and broadens the scope of the moral obligation of care to include all individual beings as well as larger collectives, noting that the majority of philosophies addressing animal welfare adopt masculine approaches founded on abstract rules, rational principles, and generalized perspectives.

10. Applied Care Ethics

In addition to the above topics, care ethics has been applied to a number of timely ethical debates, including reproductive technology, homosexuality and gay marriage, capital punishment, political agency, hospice care, and HIV treatment, as well as aspects of popular culture, such as the music of U-2 and The Sopranos. It increasingly informs moral analysis of the professions, such as education, medicine, nursing, and business, spurring new topics and modes of inquiry. It is used to provide moral assessment in other ethical fields, such as bioethics, business ethics, and environmental ethics. Perhaps because medicine is a profession that explicitly involves care for others, care ethics was quickly adopted in bioethics as a means for assessing relational and embodied aspects of medical practices and policies. As well as abortion, both Susan Sherwin and Rosemary Tong consider how feminist ethics, including an ethic of care, provides new insights into contraception and sterilization, artificial insemination and in vitro fertilization, surrogacy, and gene therapy. Care ethics is also applied by other authors to organ transplantation, the care of high risk patients, artificial womb technologies, advanced directives, and the ideal relationships between medical practitioners and patients.

11. Care Movements

There are a rising number of social movements organized around the concerns highlighted in care ethics. In 2000, Deborah Stone called for a national care movement in the U.S. to draw attention to the need for social programs of care such as universal health care, pre-school education, care for the elderly, improved foster care, and adequate wages for care-givers. In 2006, Hamington and Dorothy Miller compiled a number of essays concerning the theoretical understanding and application of care ethics to public life, including issues of welfare, same-sex marriage, restorative justice, corporate globalization, and the 21st century mother’s movement (Hamington and Miller, 2006). A number of formal political organizations of care exist, most of them on the internet, which variously center around themes of motherhood, fatherhood, health care, care as a profession, infant welfare, the woman’s movement, gay and lesbian rights, disability, and elder care. These organizations work to disseminate information, organize care advocates on key social issues, and form voting blocks. Of those focused around mothering, one of the most prominent is, organized by Joan Blades, one of the original founders of, and Kristin Rowe-Finkbeiner. Others include: The Mothers Movement Online,  Mothers Ought to Have Equal Rights, the National Association of Mothers' Centers, and Mothers and More. Judith Stadtman Tucker notes that problems with some mother’s movements include an overly exclusive focus on the interests of white, middle class care-givers, and an occasional lack of serious-mindedness, but she is also hopeful that care movements organized around motherhood can forge cultural transitions, including shorter work weeks, universal health care unhitched from employment, care leave policies, and increased levels of care work performed by men and states (Tucker, 2001).

12. References and Further Reading

  • Adams, Carol. The Sexual Politics of Meat. New York:  Continuum, 1990.
  • Adams, C. and Donovan, J. Beyond Animal Rights:  A feminist Caring Ethic for the Treatment of Animals. New York:  Continuum, 1996.
  • Adams, C. and Donovan, J. The Feminist Care Tradition in Animal Ethics. New York:  Columbia University Press, 2007.
  • Baier, Annette. "Hume: The Woman's Moral Theorist?" in Women and Moral Theory, Kittay, Eva Feder, and Meyers, Diana (ed.s). U.S.A.: Rowman & Littlefield, 1987.
  • Baier, Annette. Moral Prejudices: Essays on Ethics. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1994.
  • Benhabib, Seyla. “The Generalized and Concrete Other:  The Kohlberg-Gilligan Controversy and Moral Theory”, in Praxis International (1986) 38-60.
  • Blades, Joan and Rowe-Finkbeiner, Kristin. The Motherhood Manifesto: What America’s Moms Want and What to do about It. New York, NY: Nation Books, 2006.
  • Bowden, Peta. "An 'Ethics of Care' in Clinical Settings: Encompassing 'Feminine" and "Feminist" Perspectives." Nursing Philosophy 1.1 (2001): 36-49.
  • Bowden, Peta. Caring: Gender Sensitive Ethics. New York, NY: Routledge, 1997.
  • Brabeck, Mary. “Moral Judgment:  Theory and Research on Differences between males and Females” Developmental Review 3 (1983) 274-91.
  • Bubeck, Diemut. Care, Gender and Justice. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995.
  • Card, Claudia. “Caring and Evil.” Hypatia 5.1 (1990) 101-8.
  • Clement, Grace. Care, Autonomy and Justice: Feminism and the Ethic of Care. Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 1996.
  • Davion, Victoria. “Autonomy, Integrity, and Care” Social Theory and Practice 19.2 (1993) 161-82.
  • Donovan, Josephine and Adams, Carol, ed. Beyond Animal Rights: A Feminist Caring Ethic for the Treatment of Animals. New York, NY: Continuum Press, 1996.
  • Engster, Daniel. "Care ethics and Animal Welfare." Journal of Social Philosophy 37.4 (2006): 521.
  • Engster, Daniel. The Heart of Justice. Oxford:  Oxford University Press, 2007.
  • Friedman, Marilyn. “Beyond Caring:  The De-Moralization of Gender” in V. Held, Justice and Care:  Essential Readings in Feminist Ethics Boulder, CO:  Westview Press (2006): 61-77.
  • Fry, Sara T. "The Role of Caring in a Theory of Nursing Ethics." Hypatia 4.2. (1989): 88-101.
  • Gilligan, Carol. “Women’s Place in Man’s Life Cycle.” Harvard Educational Review, 29. (1979).
  • Gilligan, C. In A Different Voice. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1982.
  • Gilligan, C. “Adult Development and Women’s Development:  Arrangements for a Marriage” in J. Giele, ed. Women in the Middle Years. New York:  Wiley-Interscience Publications, John Wiley and Sons (1982).
  • Gilligan, C. “Reply” (to critics). Signs 11.2. (1986): 324-333.
  • Gilligan, C. and Belenky, M. “A Naturalist Study of Abortion Decisions.” In R. Selman and R. Yando (ed.s) New Directions in Child Development:  Clinical-Developmental Psychology. 7. San-Francisco, CA:  Jossey-Bass. (1980): 69-90.
  • Gilligan, C. Langdale, S. Lyons, N. & Murphy, J. The Contribution of Women’s Thought to Developmental Theory:  The Elimination of Sex Bias in Moral Developmental research and Education. Final Report to the National Institute of Education. Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press, 1982.
  • Gilligan, C. and Wiggins, G. “The Origins of Morality in Early Childhood Relationships”  in J. Kaggan and S. Lamb (ed.s) The Emergence of Morality in Early Childhood. Chicago:  University of Chicago Press (1987).
  • Gilligan, Ward, Taylor, and Bardige. Mapping the Moral Domain:  A Contribution of Women’s Thinking to Psychological Theory and Education. Cambridge, MA:  Harvard University Press, 1988.
  • Gilligan, Lyons, and Hammer. Making Connections:  The Relational Worlds of Adolescent Girls at Emma Willard School. Cambridge, MA:  Harvard University Press, 1990.
  • Haan, N. et al. “family Moral Patterns” Child Development 47.7 (1976) 1204-06.
  • Halwani, Raja. Virtuous Liaisons:  Care, Love, Sex, and Virtue Ethics. Peru, IL:  Open Court, 2003.
  • Hamington, Maurice. Embodied Care: Jane Addams, Maurice Merleau-Ponty and Feminist Ethics. Chicago, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2004.
  • Hamington, Maurice and Miller, Dorothy, ed. Socializing Care. New York: NY: Rowman & Littlefield, 2006.
  • Hanen, Marsha and Nelson, Kai, ed.s. Science, Morality, and Feminist Theory. Calgary: University of Calgary Press, 1987.
  • Harding, Sandra. "The Curious Coincidence of Feminine and African Moralities." In Women and Moral Theory. Ed. Kittay, Eva Feder and Meyers, Diane. U.S.A: Rowman & Littlefield, 1989. 296-317.
  • Harrington, Mona. Care and Equality: Inventing a New Family Politics. New York, NY: Routledge, 2000.
  • Held, Virginia. Feminist Morality: Transforming Culture, Society, and Politics. Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press, 1993.
  • Held, Virginia. “Feminist Moral Inquiry and the Feminist Future” in V. Held (ed.) Justice and Care. Boulder, Co:  Westview Press, 2006:  153-176.
  • Held, Virginia. The Ethics of Care. New York, NY: Oxford University Press, 2006.
  • Herr, Ranjoo Seodu. "Is Confucianism Compatible with care ethics?: A Critique." Philosophy East and West 53.4: 471-489.
  • Hoagland, Sarah. Lesbian Ethics. Palo Alto, CA: Institute of Lesbian Studies, 1988.
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Author Information

Maureen Sander-Staudt
Arizona State University
U. S. A.

Augustine: Political and Social Philosophy

augustineSt. Augustine (354-430 C.E.), originally named Aurelius Augustinus, was the Catholic bishop of Hippo in northern Africa.  He was a skilled Roman-trained rhetorician, a prolific writer (who produced more than 110 works over a 30-year period), and by wide acclamation, the first Christian philosopher.  Writing from a unique background and vantage point as a keen observer of society before the fall of the Roman Empire, Augustine’s views on political and social philosophy constitute an important intellectual bridge between late antiquity and the emerging medieval world.  Because of the scope and quantity of his work, many scholars consider him to have been the most influential Western philosopher.

Although Augustine certainly would not have thought of himself as a political or social philosopher per se, the record of his thoughts on such themes as the nature of human society, justice, the nature and role of the state, the relationship between church and state, just and unjust war, and peace all have played their part in the shaping of Western civilization. There is much in his work that anticipates major themes in the writings of moderns like Machiavelli, Luther, Calvin and, in particular, Hobbes.

Table of Contents

  1. Background
    1. Historical Context
    2. Augustinian Political “Theory”
    3. The Augustinian World View
  2. Foundational Political and Social Concepts
    1. Two Cities
    2. Justice and the State
    3. Church and State
  3. War and Peace
    1. War Among Nations
    2. War and Human Nature
    3. The Just War
    4. Jus ad Bellum and Jus in Bello
    5. Augustine’s Conception of Peace
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Background

a. Historical Context

Augustine’s political and social views flow directly from his theology.  The historical context is essential to understanding his purposes.  Augustine, more than any other figure of late antiquity, stands at the intellectual intersection of Christianity, philosophy, and politics.  As a Christian cleric, he takes it as his task to defend his flock against the unremitting assault by heresies spawned in an era uninformed by the immediate, divine revelations which had characterized the apostolic age. As a philosopher, he situates his arguments against the backdrop of Greek philosophy in the Platonic tradition, particularly as formulated by the Neo-Platonists of Alexandria.  As a prominent Roman citizen, he understands the Roman Empire to be the divinely-ordained medium through which the truths of Christianity are to be both spread and safeguarded.

Augustine died reciting the Penitential Psalms as the Vandals besieged the city of Hippo on the coast of northern Africa (now the city of Annaba, in Algeria). This occurred two decades after the sacking of Rome by Alaric.

b. Augustinian Political “Theory”

Augustine’s willingness to grapple with substantive political and social issues does not mean, however, that the presentation of his ideas comes pre-packaged as a simple system—or even as a system at all.  Quite the contrary, his political arguments are scattered throughout his voluminous writings, which include autobiography, sermons, expositions, commentaries, letters, and Christian apologetics.  Moreover, the contexts in which the political and social issues are addressed are equally varied.

Nevertheless, it would be a mistake to suggest that his arguments are not informed by a cogent theory.  Taken together, his political and social musings constitute a remarkable tapestry.  Indeed, the consistency evident in the expression of his varied but related ideas leads both fairly and directly to the assumption that Augustine’s political-philosophical statements arise from a consistent set of premises which guide him to his conclusions; in other words, they reveal the presence of an underlying, if unstated, theory.

c. The Augustinian World View

Because Augustine considers the Christian scriptures to constitute the touchstone against which philosophy—including political philosophy—must be assayed, his world view necessarily includes the Christian tenets of the Creation, the Fall of man, and the Redemption.  In stark contrast to the pagan philosophers who preceded him—who viewed the unfolding of history as a cyclical phenomenon, Augustine conceives history in strictly linear terms, with a beginning and an end.  According to Augustine, the earth was brought into existence ex nihilo by a perfectly good and just God, who created man. The earth is not eternal; the earth, as well as time, has both a beginning and an end.

Man, on the other hand, was brought into existence to endure eternally. Damnation is the just desert of all men because of the Fall of Adam, who, having been created with free will, chose to disrupt the perfectly good order established by God. As the result of Adam’s Fall, all human beings are heirs to the effects of Adam’s original sin, and all are vessels of pride, avarice, greed and self-interest.  For reasons known only to God, He has predestined some fixed number of men for salvation (as a display of His unmerited mercy—a purely gratuitous act altogether independent even of God’s foreknowledge of any good deeds those men might do while on earth), while most He has predestined for damnation as a just consequence of the Fall. The onward march of human history, then, constitutes the unfolding of the divine plan which will culminate in one or the other outcome for every member of the human family.

Within this framework of political and legal systems, the state is a divinely ordained punishment for fallen man, with its armies, its power to command, coerce, punish, and even put to death, as well as its institutions such as slavery and private property. God shapes the ultimate ends of man’s existence through it.  The state simultaneously serves the divine purposes of chastening the wicked and refining the righteous.  Also simultaneously, the state constitutes a sort of remedy for the effects of the Fall, in that it serves to maintain such modicum of peace and order as it is possible for fallen man to enjoy in the present world.

While it is not clear that God predestines every event during man’s sojourn on earth, nothing happens in contravention of His designs. In any case, predestination fixes the ultimate destination of every human being—as well as the political states to which they belong.  Hence, predestination for Augustine is the proverbial elephant in the room. Whether predestination was divinely contemplated prior or incidental to the Fall (a point which Augustine never clearly articulates), the following problem arises:  If one is to be saved or damned by divine fiat, what difference does it make whether the world possesses the social order of a state?  For those who are predestined for damnation, what is the point of their being “chastened” (or a means to encourage their reformation) by the state?  For those predestined for salvation, what is the point of their being refined by the vicissitudes of life in a political state?  In order to prevent the collapse of such a systematic account of the human condition as Augustine provides, the question simply must be set aside as a matter unknowable to finite man.  However, this means that the best Augustine can hope to accomplish is to provide a description of political life on earth, but not a prescription for how to obtain membership in the perfect society of heaven; for, even strict obedience to Christian precepts will not compensate for one’s not being gratuitously elected for salvation.

As the social fabric of the world around him unravels in the twilight years of the Roman Empire, Augustine attempts to elucidate the relationship between the eternal, invisible verities of his faith and the stark realities of the present, observable political and social conditions of humanity.  At the intersection of these two concerns, Augustine finds what for him is the central question of politics:  How do the faithful operate successfully but justly in an unjust world, , where selfish interests dominate, where the general welfare is rarely sought, and where good and evil men are inextricably (and, to human eyes, often unidentifiably) intermingled, yet search for a heavenly reward in the world hereafter?

2. Foundational Political and Social Concepts

a. Two Cities

Even though those elected for salvation and those elected for damnation are thoroughly intermingled, the distinction arising from their respective destinies gives rise to two classes of persons, to whom Augustine refers collectively and allegorically as cities—the City of God and the earthly city.  Citizens of the earthly city are the unregenerate progeny of Adam and Eve, who are justifiably damned because of Adam’s Fall.  These persons, according to Augustine, are aliens to God’s love (not because God refuses to love them, but because they refuse to love God as evidenced by their rebellious disposition inherited from the Fall).  Indeed, the object of their love—whatever it may be—is something other than God.  In particular, citizens of the “earthly city” are distinguished by their lust for material goods and for domination over others.  On the other hand, citizens of the City of God are “pilgrims and foreigners” who (because God, the object of their love, is not immediately available for their present enjoyment) are very much out of place in a world without an earthly institution sufficiently similar to the City of God.  No political state, nor even the institutional church, can be equated with the City of God.  Moreover, there is no such thing as “dual citizenship” in the two cities; every member of the human family belongs to one—and only one.

b. Justice and the State

The Augustinian notion of justice includes what by his day was a well-established definition of justice of “giving every man his due.”  However, Augustine grounds his application of the definition in distinctively Christian philosophical commitments:  “justice,” says Augustine, “is love serving God only, and therefore ruling well all else.”  Accordingly, justice becomes the crucial distinction between ideal political states (none of which actually exist on earth) and non-ideal political states—the status of every political state on earth.  For example, the Roman Empire could not be synonymous with the City of God precisely because it lacked true justice as defined above; and since, “where there is no justice there is no commonwealth,” Rome could not truly be a commonwealth, that is, an ideal state.  “Remove justice,” Augustine asks rhetorically, “and what are kingdoms but gangs of criminals on a large scale?  What are criminal gangs but petty kingdoms?”  No earthly state can claim to possess true justice, but only some relative justice by which one state is more just than another.  Likewise, the legitimacy of any earthly political regime can be understood only in relative terms:  The emperor and the pirate have equally legitimate domains if they are equally just.

Nevertheless, political states, imperfect as they are,  serve a divine purpose.  At the very least, they serve as vehicles for maintaining order and for preventing what Hobbes will later call the “war of all against all.”  In that respect, the state is a divine gift and an expression of divine mercy—especially if the state is righteously ruled.  The state maintains order by keeping wicked men in check through the fear of punishment.  Although God will eventually punish the sins of all those elected for damnation, He uses the state to levy more immediate punishments against both the damned and the saved (or against the wicked and the righteous, the former dichotomy not necessarily synonymous with the latter).  Rulers, as God’s ministers, punish the guilty and always are justified in punishing sins “against nature,” and circumstantially justified in punishing sins “against custom” or “against the laws.” The latter two categories of sins change from time to time.  In this regard, the institution of the state marks a relative return to order from the chaos of the Fall.  Rulers have the right to establish any law that does not conflict with the law of God. Citizens have the duty to obey their political leaders regardless of whether the leader is wicked or righteous.  There is no right of civil disobedience.  Citizens are always duty bound to obey God; and when the imperatives of obedience to God and obedience to civil authority conflict, citizens must choose to obey God and willingly accept the punishment of disobedience. Nevertheless, those empowered to levy punishment should take no delight in the task.  For example, the prayer of the judge who condemns a man to death should be, as Augustine’s urges, “From my necessities [of imposing judgment to a person] deliver thou me.”

c. Church and State

Even though the ostensible reason for the state’s divinely appointed existence is to assist and bless humankind, there is no just state, says Augustine, because men reject the thing that best could bring justice to an imperfect world, namely, the teachings of Christ.  Augustine does not suggest that current rejection of Christ’s teachings means that all hope for future amendment and reformation is lost.  However, Augustine’s whole tenor is that there is no reason to expect that the political jurisdictions of this world ever will be anything different than what they now are, if the past is any predictor of the future.  Hence, Augustine concludes that

Christ’s servants, whether they are kings, or princes, or judges, or soldiers . . . are bidden, if need be, to endure the wickedness of an utterly corrupt state, and by that endurance to win for themselves a place of glory . . . in the Heavenly Commonwealth, whose law is the will of God.

Augustine clearly holds that the establishment and success of the Roman Empire, along with its embracing of Christianity as its official religion, was part of the divine plan of the true God.  Indeed, he holds that the influence of Christianity upon the empire could be only salutary in its effect:

Were our religion listened to as it deserves,” says Augustine, “it would establish, consecrate, strengthen, and enlarge the commonwealth in a way beyond all that Romulus, Numa, Brutus, and all the other men of renown in Roman history achieved.

Still, while Augustine doubtless holds that it is better for Rome to be Christian than not, he clearly recognizes that officially embracing Christianity does not automatically transform an earthly state into the City of God.  Indeed, he regards Rome as “a kind of second Babylon.”  Even if the Roman Emperor and the Roman Pontiff were one and the same—even if the structures of state and church merged so as to become institutionally the same—they would not thereby become the City of God, because citizenship in the City of God is determined at the individual and not the institutional level.

Augustine does not wish ill for Rome.  Quite the contrary, he supplicates God for Rome’s welfare,  since he belongs to it, in temporal terms at least.  He sees Rome as the last bastion against the advances of the pagan barbarians, who surely must not be allowed to overrun the mortal embodiment of Christendom that Rome represents.  Nevertheless, Augustine cannot be overly optimistic about the future of the Roman state as such—not because it is Rome, but because it is a state; for any society of men other than the City of God is part and parcel of the earthly city, which is doomed to inevitable demise.  Even so, states like Rome can perform the useful purpose of championing the cause of the Church, protecting it from assault and compelling those who have fallen away from fellowship with it to return to the fold.  Indeed, it is entirely within the provinces of the state to punish heretics and schismatics.

3. War and Peace

a. War Among Nations

Inasmuch as the history of human society is largely the history of warfare, it seems quite natural for Augustine to explain war as being within God’s unfolding plan for human history.  As Augustine states, “It rests with the decision of God in his just judgment and mercy either to afflict or console mankind, so that some wars come to an end more speedily, others more slowly.”

Wars serve the function of putting mankind on notice, as it were, of the value of consistently righteous living.  Although one might feel to call upon Augustine to defend the notion that God can, with propriety, use so terrible a vehicle as war to chasten the wicked, two points must be kept in mind:  The first point is that, for Augustine, all of God’s acts are just, by definition, even if the application of that definition to specific cases of the human experience eludes human reasoning.             This point invites a somewhat more philosophically intriguing question:  Is it just to compel men to do good who, when left to their own devices, would prefer evil?  If one were forced to act righteously contrary to his or her will, is it not the case that he or she would still lack the change of heart that is necessary to produce a repentant attitude—an attitude that results in genuine reformation?  Perhaps; but Augustine is unwilling to concede that it is better, in the name of recognizing the agency of others, to let them continue to wallow in evil practices.  Augustine argues,

The aim towards which a good will compassionately devotes its efforts is to secure that a bad will be rightly directed.  For who does not know that a man is not condemned on any other ground than because his bad will deserved it, and that no man is saved who has not a good will?

Exactly how God is to bring about his good purposes through the process of war may not be clear to man in any particular case.  Any who acquire a glimpse of understanding as to why the divine economy operates as it does truly possess a good will and shall not hesitate to administer to those erring, according to God’s direction, the punitive discipline that war is intended to bring.  Moreover, those of good will shall administer discipline to those erring by moving them toward repentance and reformation.

All of this leads conveniently to a second point: War can bring the need to discipline by chastening. Those of good will do not manifest cruelty in the proper administration of punishment but, rather, in the withholding of punishment.  “It does not follow,” Augustine states, “that those who are loved should be cruelly left to yield themselves with impunity to their bad will; but in so far as power is given, they ought to be both prevented from evil and compelled to good.”  What if, however, the violence of war serves only to subdue the wrongdoings of the wicked but fails to produce the change of heart that would characterize the transition from a bad to a good will—much like the case of the criminal who is sentenced to prison but who feels no remorse for his or her actions and, given his or her freedom, would all too readily repeat the crime?  For Augustine, it is always better to restrain an evil man from the commission of evil acts than it is to permit his continued perpetration of those acts.  As for the evil but unrepentant man, it would seem that he will have failed to reap the intended benefit of God’s chastening, which, reckoned by any measure, is a great tragedy indeed.

For Augustine, even the death of the mortal body, as ultimate a penalty as it might appear from the mortal perspective, is not nearly so serious a consequence as that which would ensue if one is left to wallow in sin: “But great and holy men, although they at the time knew excellently well that that death which separates the soul from the body is not to be dreaded, yet, in accordance with the sentiment of those who might fear it, punished some sins with death, both because the living were struck with a salutary fear, and because it was not death itself that would injure those who were being punished with death, but sin, which might be increased if they continued to live.”

Writing after the time when Christianity became the official religion of the Roman Empire, Augustine holds that there is no prohibition against a Christian serving the state as a soldier in its army.  Neither is there any prohibition against taking the lives of the enemies of the state, so long as he does it in his public capacity as a soldier and not in the private capacity of a murderer.  Nevertheless, Augustine also urges that soldiers should go to war mournfully and never take delight in the shedding of blood.

b. War and Human Nature

If, however, the presence of war serves as a defining characteristic of the earthly city, why does Augustine not pursue the course taken by some of the Latin Patristic writers who precede him by labeling war and military service as merely a “worldly” institution in which true Christians have no place.  The answer seems to lie in Augustine’s world view, which differs from that of many of his predecessors in terms of his optimism for man to comprehend the ultimate verities, live in an orderly manner and find his way back to God.  He becomes quite pessimistic though in his view of human nature and of the ability and desire of humans to maintain themselves orderly, much less rightly.  Pride, vanity and the lust for domination entice men toward waging wars and committing all manner of violence, because of men’s tendency to do evil as the result of Adam’s Fall.  Augustine holds that, given the inextricable mixing of citizens of the two cities, the total avoidance of war or its effects is a practical impossibility for all men, including the righteous.  Happily, he holds that the day will come when, coincident with the end of the earthly city, wars will no longer be fought.  For, says Augustine, citing words from the Psalms to the effect that God will one day bring a cessation of all wars,

This not yet see we fulfilled:  yet are there wars, wars among nations for sovereignty; among sects, among Jews, Pagans, Christians, heretics, are wars, frequent wars, some for the truth, some for falsehood contending.  Not yet then is this fulfilled, ‘He maketh wars to cease unto the end of the earth;’ but haply it shall be fulfilled.

For the present, however, man—particularly Christian man—is left with the question of how to live in a world full of war.

c. The Just War

As the Roman Empire collapses around him, Augustine confronted the question of what justifies warfare for a Christian.  On the one hand, the wicked are not particularly concerned about just wars.  On the other hand, the righteous vainly hope to avoid being affected by wars in this life,   and at best they can hope for just wars rather than unjust ones.   This is by no means a perfect solution; but then again, this is not a perfect world.  If it were, all talk of just wars would be altogether nonsensical. Perfect solutions characterize only the heavenly City of God. Its pilgrim citizens sojourning on earth can do no better than try to cope with the present difficulties and imperfections of the earthly life.  Thus, for Augustine, the just war is a coping mechanism for use by the righteous who aspire to citizenship in the City of God.  In terms of the traditional notion of jus ad bellum (justice of war, that is, the circumstances in which wars can be justly fought), war is a coping mechanism for righteous sovereigns who would ensure that their violent international encounters are minimal, a reflection of the Divine Will to the greatest extent possible, and always justified.  In terms of the traditional notion of jus in bello (justice in war, or the moral considerations which ought to constrain the use of violence in war), war is a coping mechanism for righteous combatants who, by divine edict, have no choice but to subject themselves to their political masters and seek to ensure that they execute their war-fighting duty as justly as possible. Sometimes that duty might arise in the most trying of circumstances, or under the most wicked of regimes; for

Christ’s servants, whether they are kings, or princes, or judges, or soldiers, or provincials, whether rich or poor, freemen or slaves, men or women, are bidden, if need be, to endure the wickedness of an utterly corrupt state, and by that endurance to win for themselves a place of glory

hereafter in the heavenly City of God.

In sum, why would a man like Augustine, whose eye is fixed upon attainment of citizenship in the heavenly city, find it necessary to delineate what counts as a just war in this lost and fallen world?  In general terms, the demands of moral life are so thoroughly interwoven with social life that the individual cannot be separated from citizenship in one or the other city.  In more specific terms, the just man who walks by faith needs to understand how to cope with the injustices and contradictions of war as much as he needs to understand how to cope with all other aspects of the present world where he is a stranger and pilgrim.  Augustine takes important cues from both Cicero and Ambrose and synthesizes their traditions into a Christianized world view that still retains strong ties to the pre-Christian philosophic past.  He resolves the dilemma of just war and pacifist considerations by denying the dilemma: war is simply a part of the human experience that God Himself has ordained or permitted.  War arises from, and stands as a clear manifestation of, the nature of fallen man.  For adherents to nominal Christianity, the explanatory power of Augustine’s thoughts on just war is substantial; his approach enables Christians to understand just war as a coping mechanism for just men who are trying to get along as morally (if not as piously) as they can in an imperfect world.

However, since Augustine seeks to resolve the nature of his ethical tensions, the synthetic character of Augustine’s approach to war is important, not merely for adherents to Christianity, but also for others seeking a strictly rational account of the problem.  For example, if one were to take a de-theologized view of Augustine’s approach and focus simply upon the general theoretical problem of the morality of war, Augustine’s attempt fully deserves serious philosophical consideration. His approach explains how a morally upright citizen of a relatively just state could be justified in pursuing warfare, in prosecuting war, and ultimately, although unhappily, in taking human life.  In any case, Augustine’s just war theory arises from his most deeply rooted philosophical assumptions.  Augustine as a Christian philosopher achieves a full synthesis of the Roman and Christian values associated with war in a way that legitimizes war as an instrument of national policy which, although inferior to the perfect ideals of Christianity, is one which Christians cannot altogether avoid and with which they must in some sense make their peace.

d. Jus ad Bellum and Jus in Bello

Traditionally, the philosophical treatment of the just war is divided into two categories:  jus in bellum and jus in bello.  The former describes the necessary (and, by some accounts, sufficient) conditions for justifying engagement in war.  The latter describes the necessary conditions for conducting war in a just manner.

Augustine’s jus ad bellum prescripts enjoin that wars can be initiated justly only on the basis of:

1.  a just cause, such as to defend the state from external invasion; to defend the safety or honor of the state, with the realization that their simultaneous defense might be impossible; to avenge injuries; to punish a nation for failure to take corrective action for wrongs (legal or moral ) committed by its citizens; to come to the defense of allies; to gain the return of something that was wrongfully taken; or to obey a divine command to go to war (which, in practice, issues from the political head of state acting as God’s lieutenant on earth); and in any case, the just cause must be at least more just than the cause of one’s enemies;

2.  a rightly intended will, which has the restoration of peace as its prime objective, takes no delight in the wickedness of potential adversaries, views waging war as a stern necessity, tolerates no action calculated to provoke a war, and does not seek to conquer others merely for conquest’s sake or for territorial expansion; and

3. a declaration of war by a competent authority, and except in the most unusual of circumstances, in a public manner, and only as a last resort.

Concerning jus in bello, Augustine holds that wars, once begun, must be fought in a manner which:

1. represents a proportional response to the wrong to be avenged, with violence being constrained within the limits of military necessity;

2. discriminates between proper objects of violence (that is, combatants) and noncombatants, such as women, children, the elderly, the clergy, and so forth.; and

3. observes good faith in its interactions with the enemy, by scrupulously observing treaties and not prosecuting the war in a treacherous manner.

e. Augustine’s Conception of Peace

Both Augustine’s political world view and his approach to war incorporate his conception of peace.  According to Augustine, God designed all humans to live together in the “bond of peace.” However, fallen man lives in society  as according to the divine will or as opposing it.  Augustine distinguishes the two cities in several important ways, as well as the kind of peace they seek:

There is, in fact, one city of men who choose to live by the standard of the flesh, another of those who choose to live by the standard of the spirit.  The citizens of each of these desire their own kind of peace, and when they achieve their aim, that is the kind of peace in which they live.

Because the common choice of fallen man is a peace of his own liking—one that selfishly serves his own immediate or foreseeable ends, peace becomes, in practice, merely an interlude between ongoing states of war.  Augustine is quick to point out that this life carries with it no guarantee of peace; that blessed state is reserved for the saved in heaven.

Augustine delineates three kinds of peace:  the ultimate and perfect peace which exists exclusively in the City of God, the interior peace enjoyed by the pilgrim citizens of the City of God as they sojourn on earth, and the peace which is common to the two cities. Sadly, Augustine is abundantly clear that temporal peace is rather an anomalous condition in the totality of human history and that perfect peace is altogether unattainable on earth:

Such is the instability of human affairs that no people has ever been allowed such a degree of tranquility as to remove all dread of hostile attacks on their dwelling in this world.  That place, then, which is promised as a dwelling of such peace and security is eternal, and is reserved for eternal beings.

However, Augustine insists that, by any estimation, it is in the best interest of everyonesaint or sinner—to try to keep the peace here and now; and indeed, establishing and maintaining an earthly peace is as fundamental to the responsibilities of the state as protecting the state in times of war.

As for the church’s quest for peace, he writes, “it seems to me that no limit can be set to the number of persecutions which the Church is bound to suffer for her training;” and he opines that persecutions will continue until the final scenes of the current state of human history incidental to the second coming of Christ. Interestingly, Augustine gives no suggestion whatsoever that the rest of the earth will be at peace while this violence against the church continues.  On the contrary, the entire tenor of his argument suggests that anti-Christian violence is merely typical of the violence and disorder that will accompany the human experience until the second coming of Christ.

While men do not agree on which kind of peace to seek, all agree that peace in some form is the end they desire to achieve.  Even in war, all parties involved desire—and fight to obtain—some kind of peace.  Ironically, although peace is the end toward which wars are fought, war seems to be the more enduring, more characteristic of the two states in the human experience. War is the natural (albeit lamentable) state in which fallen man finds himself.  The flesh and the spirit of man—although both are good—are in perpetual opposition:

But what in fact, do we achieve, when we desire to be made perfect by the Highest Good?  It can, surely, only be a situation where the desires of the flesh do not oppose the spirit, and where there is in us no vice for the spirit to oppose with its desires.  Now we cannot achieve this in our present life, for all our wishing. But we can at least, with God’s help, see to it that we do not give way to the desires of the flesh which oppose the spirit to be overcome, and that we are not dragged to the perpetration of sin with our own consent.

Augustine concludes that war among men and nations cannot be avoided altogether because it is simply characteristic of the present existence.  The contention that typifies war is merely the social counterpart to the spirit-body tension that typifies every individual person.  However, man can, through the general application of divine precepts contained in scripture and through the pursuit of virtue as dictated by reason, manage that tension both on the individual and societal levels in such a way as to obtain a transitory peace.  War and peace are two sides of the same Augustinian coin.  Owing to the injustice that is inherent in the mortal state, the former is presently unavoidable, and the latter, in its perfect manifestation, is presently unattainable.

4. Conclusion

In sum, the state is an institution imposed upon fallen man for his temporal benefit, even if the majority of men will not ultimately benefit from it in light of their predestination to damnation.  However, if one can successfully set aside Augustine’s doctrine of predestination, one finds in his writings an enormously valuable descriptive account of the psychology of fallen man, which can take the reader a very great distance toward understanding social interactions among men and nations.  Although the doctrine of predestination is indispensable for understanding Augustine’s theology, its prominence does not preclude one from reaping value from his appraisal of the state of man and his political and social relationships in the fallen “earthly city,” to which all either belong or with which they have unavoidable contact.

5. References and Further Reading

All the primary sources are readily available in English.

a. Primary Sources

  • Augustine.  City of God [De civitate Dei]. Translated by Marcus Dods, in The Nicene and Post-Nicene Fathers. Edited by Philip Schaff.  First Series.  Vol. II. Grand Rapids:  Eerdmans Publishing Company, 1956.
  • Augustine.  On Christian Doctrine [De doctrina christiana]. Translated by J. F. Shaw, in The Nicene and Post-Nicene Fathers. Edited by Philip Schaff.  First Series.  Vol. II. Grand Rapids:  Eerdmans Publishing Company, 1956.
  • Augustine.  On Free Choice of the Will [De libero arbitrio libri III].  Translated by Anna S. Benjamin and L. H. Hackstaff.  New York:  Macmillan Publishing Company, 1964.
  • Augustine.  Our Lord’s Sermon on the Mount [De Sermone Domini in Monte secundum Matthaeum]. Translated by William Findlay, in The Nicene and Post-Nicene Fathers. Edited by Philip Schaff.  First Series.  Vol. VI. Grand Rapids:  Eerdmans Publishing Company, 1956.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bainton, Roland H.  Christian Attitudes Toward War and Peace:  A Historical Survey and Critical Re-evaluation. Nashville:  Abington Press, 1960.
    • On Augustine and War.
  • Battenhouse, Roy W.  A Companion to the Study of St. Augustine.  New York:  Oxford University Press, 1969.
  • Deane, Herbert A. The Political and Social Ideas of St. Augustine. New York:  Columbia University Press, 1963.
    • The indispensable and definitive work on Augustine’s political and social philosophy.
  • Gilson, Etienne.  The Christian Philosophy of Saint Augustine.  New York:  Random House, 1960.
  • Mattox, John Mark.  St. Augustine and the Theory of Just War.  London:  Thoemmes Continuum, 2006.
    • On Augustine and War.
  • Swift, Louis J.  The Early Fathers on War and Military Service. Wilmington:  Michael Glazier, Inc., 1983.
    • On Augustine and War.


Author Information

J. Mark Mattox
U. S. A.

Surrogate Parenting

Surrogate parenting is an arrangement in which one or more persons, typically a married infertile couple (the intended rearing parents), contract with a woman to gestate a child for them and then to relinquish it to them after birth. Surrogate parenting is also sometimes referred to as “contract pregnancy,” in part, so as not to beg the question about who is the child’s real mother, but also to refer to the non-nuclear-familial nature of the arrangement.  That is, this is a mode of parenting which allows a couple to have a child by involving a third party to their relationship who serves as birth mother, whether there is a contract or not. As will become apparent, surrogate parenting complicates the parenting terrain and, as such, raises significant philosophical and ethical issues. This article briefly examines some of the principal differences between commercial and non-commercial forms of surrogate/contract parenting arrangements, including the presentation of arguments against and for the moral appropriateness of this sort of parenting arrangement. After raising some of the principal challenges, four legal remedies for this complex mode of parenting are considered. This is followed by a brief summary of some healthcare organizations’ and professionals’ attitudes toward surrogacy/contract parenting arrangements. The article concludes with an assessment of the current availability and accessibility of surrogacy services and some observations about the future of surrogacy/contract parenting arrangements.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Traditional Surrogacy versus Gestational Surrogacy
  3. Commercial Surrogacy vs. Noncommercial Surrogacy
  4. Moral Arguments against Surrogacy vs. Moral Arguments for Surrogacy
  5. Legal Remedies for Surrogacy Arrangements
    1. Banning
    2. Endorsement
    3. Assimilation
    4. Hands-off
  6. Healthcare Organizations’ and Professionals’ Attitudes toward Surrogacy Arrangements
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

Based on available statistics, which are quite incomplete due to a lack of reporting regulations, about 1,500 to 2,000 surrogate/contracted babies are born per annum in the United States (Ali and Kelley 2008, 44). In addition, several thousands more are born each year as the result of a surrogate arrangement in a wide-variety of nations worldwide. Australia, Canada, and Brazil report numbers at least as large as those reported in the United States (Covington and Burns 2006, 371); and in India, where commercial surrogacy was legalized in 1992, poor women are recruited to gestate what may amount to hundreds (more likely thousands) of babies for couples throughout the world (Gentleman 2008, A9).

Although surrogate parenting arrangements are spreading across the globe, such arrangements apparently remain the exception rather than the rule. Most people prefer not to involve third parties in their attempts to procreate, and most people cannot afford to finance expensive third-party pregnancies. Still, the existence and use of surrogacy arrangements lead society to raise substantial questions about the nature of parenthood. What makes a parent the real parent of a child? The fact that she or he is genetically related to the child? The fact that she or he rears the child? Or the fact that she gestates the child (at present, gestation is an exclusively female task)? Is surrogate parenting just one of a series of steps towards what some term “collaborative reproduction”? In the future, will an increasing number of people form families that consist of an egg and/or sperm donor(s), a gestational mother, and one or more men and women who collaboratively produce and rear a child to adulthood? Or will most people continue to form the kind of nuclear, biologically-based families that exist today?

2. Traditional Surrogacy versus Gestational Surrogacy

There are two basic types of surrogate parenting: traditional surrogacy and gestational surrogacy. In traditional surrogacy, the surrogate is inseminated with the sperm of the man who intends to be the child’s rearing parent. Because the surrogate is both the genetic mother and the gestational mother of the child, she must legally terminate her parental rights to the child after its birth, at which point the intended female rearing parent may adopt the child as her stepchild. The intended male rearing parent does not need to adopt the child because he is the child’s genetic father.

The situation is quite different in a gestational surrogacy arrangement where both of the intended rearing parents may have a genetic connection to the child. The intended rearing mother’s eggs are fertilized with the intended rearing father’s sperm in vitro (outside the womb). The resulting embryo(s) are then implanted in the surrogate’s womb. The surrogate’s only connection to the child is gestational. In a variation on this arrangement, the intended rearing parents provide the surrogate with an embryo(s) to gestate for them. If the intended rearing parents are also the child’s genetic parents, they are not required to adopt the child. However, if one or both of the intended rearing parents do not have a genetic connection to the child, they may be required to adopt the child. For example, if a couple adopt surplus frozen embryos from an assisted reproduction clinic, they may be required to adopt any child(ren) that result from the embryo(s)’ gestation in a surrogate.

Infertile, heterosexual couples are the group most likely to contract a surrogate mother. However, single people, lesbian couples, gay couples, and even fertile people may also seek the services of a contracted mother. Collaborative reproductive and/or parenting arrangements have a long history throughout the world. For example, in the Judeo-Christian tradition, the Old Testament octogenarian couple, Abraham and Sarah, used a surrogate mother to carry a child to term for them. Much later, throughout the European continent and England, middle- and upper-class women used wet nurses to nurture their infant children. Moreover, in polygamous families, two or more wives of one husband collaboratively raise all of his children. Thus, it should not surprise us that people are increasingly entering into formal surrogacy/contract parenting arrangements.

3. Commercial Surrogacy vs. Noncommercial Surrogacy

Of particular significance in any discussion of surrogate parent arrangements is the fact that some of them are commercial while others are noncommercial. Commercial surrogate parenting arrangements involve monetary payments both to the surrogate and to other third parties. Depending on state laws regulating commercial surrogacy, the cost of such arrangements in the early 21st Century ranged anywhere from $20,000 to as high as $150,000 in the United States. Surrogates typically received about $20,000 with the rest of the costs being paid out to healthcare professionals, counselors, screeners, lawyers, and surrogate brokers. In an effort to hold their costs down, some intended parents have engaged in reproductive tourism, traveling to developing nations, where the total cost for a surrogate parenting arrangement ranges from $5,000 to $12,000 largely because women are willing to rent their wombs for a relatively low sum of money.

In contrast to commercial surrogacy, non-commercial surrogacy involves an arrangement where the intended rearing parents use the services of a family member or a friend. The surrogate’s compensation supposedly consists in the satisfaction she derives from giving the gift of a new human life to people for whom she personally cares. Typically, the surrogate does not expect or want monetary compensation for her gestational services. At the most, she will accept funds to cover costs such as physician’s bills.

4. Moral Arguments against Surrogacy vs. Moral Arguments for Surrogacy

As noted above, the number of surrogate babies born annually in the United States or elsewhere is relatively small. In large measure, it is probably failed, highly-publicized surrogate parenting arrangements such as the notorious Baby M case that continue to put a damper on intended rearing parents using surrogate parenting arrangements. In the 1980s New Jersey Baby M case, Mary Beth Whitehead contracted with William Stern to be artificially inseminated with his sperm, to get pregnant (if possible), to carry the child to term, and then to relinquish the child to Stern. Whitehead and Stern also agreed that Whitehead would receive $10,000 for a healthy child, but only $1,000 for a miscarried or still-born child. In addition, Whitehead agreed not to engage in sexual relations with her husband until she was pregnant; to abstain from harmful substances during the pregnancy; to undergo amniocentesis; and to submit to abortion if Stern so requested. Finally, Whitehead agreed that, upon the child’s birth, she would terminate her maternal rights so that Stern’s wife could adopt the baby.

Whitehead became pregnant and gave birth to a baby girl. But she did not relinquish the baby to Stern. Feeling very attached to the baby, Whitehead refused to abide by the terms of the contract. At first, lawyer Noel Keane, who had brokered the surrogacy arrangement, did not take Whitehead that seriously. He managed to persuade Whitehead to give the baby to the Sterns for an overnight stay. But when Whitehead became extremely upset the next day, the Sterns gave the baby back to her. They thought that within a short time, the $10,000 fee would start looking better to Whitehead than the responsibility of adding another child to her existing two-child family. The Sterns’ speculation turned out to be false. Whitehead soon told the Sterns she had reached a final decision and would never relinquish the child to them. Money was not nearly as important to her as love for the baby. At one point, the entire Whitehead family fled to Florida with the baby to escape the arm of the law, but the New Jersey police tracked the Whiteheads down and seized the baby. By then the Sterns had persuaded Judge Harvey Sorkow to grant them sole custody of the baby.

After a prolonged custody battle between Whitehead and Stern, presided over by none other than Judge Sorkow, the court determined it was in the best interests of “Baby M” to enforce the surrogacy contract. Judge Sorkow thought that Whitehead was unfit parent material because of her emotional instability and the fact that she had entered into the arrangement at all. Stern was given custody of the baby, Whitehead was stripped of her parental rights, and Stern’s wife was permitted to adopt the baby. Whitehead appealed the court’s decision and, after another protracted legal battle, the New Jersey Supreme Court overturned Sorkow’s decision, invalidating commercial surrogacy contracts as a disguised form of baby-selling. As the immediate consequence of its decision, the New Jersey Supreme Court voided the termination of Whitehead’s parental rights and invalidated Mrs. Stern’s adoption of the baby. However, the high court allowed the Sterns to keep the baby with the proviso that Whitehead be given visitation rights. The high court reasoned it was in the best interests of the two-year-old child to remain in the home of the only family she had ever known: the Sterns. Although many people thought this decision was fair, others complained it was an instance where privileged people, the Sterns, were presumed by virtue of their wealth and status to be better parents than poor, working-class people like the Whiteheads.

Cases like the Baby M case have prompted opponents of commercial surrogacy to emphasize that such parenting arrangements tend to exploit poor, young, single, or ethnic/minority women desperate for money, and that some surrogacy agencies instruct surrogates to view themselves as mere incubators for intended rearing parent(s)’ babies. In addition, some opponents of surrogacy object to non-commercial surrogacy for at least two reasons. First, a female family member may be pressured to demonstrate love for another female family member, for example, by serving as a surrogate mother for her. Second, a child may be deeply troubled upon discovering that not the mother who is raising her but actually her aunt is her gestational and perhaps also genetic mother. Finally, yet other opponents of surrogacy object that surrogacy arrangements risk the commoditization of babies as goods or products that can be contracted for as if they were mere things rather than human persons.

Advocates of surrogate parenting accuse its opponents of distorting empirical facts to rationalize their discomfort about breaking the formerly seamless web between genetic, gestational, and rearing forms of parentage. Although those who favor surrogacy concede that intended rearing parents are typically more affluent than most of the surrogates they hire, they deny that intended rearing parents routinely exploit surrogates. They note that, truth be told, most surrogates are white, between 20 and 30 years old, working class (not underclass), and married. Moreover, most surrogacy agencies prefer to use surrogates who have had at least one child and are altruistically as well as financially motivated to work as surrogates. Advocates of surrogate parenting also stress that when intended rearing parents and surrogates have and maintain good relationships with each other, no harm befalls the very-much wanted child. If anything, such a child generally finds him or herself in a particularly loving family. Finally, they claim that in a society that increasingly favors open adoptions and celebrates blended families, surrogate parenting is just another way for people to establish a family.

5. Legal Remedies for Surrogacy Arrangements

In the United Sates, four legal remedies (each with varying permutations) have been proposed at the state level to regulate surrogate parenting. They are: (1) banning commercial surrogate parenting arrangements; (2) legally enforcing most commercial and even non-commercial surrogate parenting arrangements; (3) assimilating most surrogate parenting arrangements into either traditional or modified adoption law; and (4) refusing to legally enforce any surrogate parenting arrangement whatsoever. Each of these remedies has its strengths and weaknesses, and none of them is the clear winner in attempts to properly regulate surrogate parenting arrangements.

a. Banning

A relatively small number of states ban commercial surrogacy, imposing civil and criminal penalties on surrogacy brokers in particular. Michigan is probably the most anti-surrogacy state in the Union. In 1993, Michigan legislators ruled it is a misdemeanor to be party to a surrogacy contract and a felony to serve as a “surrogate broker,” with a maximum penalty of a $50,000 fine and five years in prison (MICH. COMP. LAWS, 1993). Even though states like Michigan typically do not prohibit non-commercial surrogate parenting arrangements, they do refuse to enforce them as binding contracts. States that ban commercial surrogacy do so on the grounds that it is a disguised form of baby-selling that exploits women and commodifies children. They dismiss arguments that the intended rearing parents do not actually pay for the baby, but only for the surrogate’s gestational services. Such states also dismiss arguments that most women who serve as surrogates do so freely, and that the children to which they give birth are not viewed as merchandise but as very much wanted children. Whether outright bans of commercial surrogate parenting arrangements are constitutionally permissible remains an open question, however. Advocates of these arrangements argue that if the only way a married infertile couple, for example, can have child genetically-related to them is to use a surrogate mother service, then prohibiting them from doing so is probably a violation of their fundamental right to procreate.

b. Endorsement

An increasing number of states use codified law to recognize and enforce properly negotiated surrogate parenting contracts. One state, California, uses case law to enforce parenting contracts. Importantly, these states regulate the terms of the surrogacy contract. For example, in most states, intended rearing parents are not permitted to pay for more than the surrogate’s medical and ancillary expenses; and, in all states, intended rearing parents may not interfere with a surrogate’s abortion rights. Interestingly, most states that enforce surrogacy contracts are maximally supportive of intended rearing parents who are also the genetic parents of the child. These states reason that the intended rearing parents have two parental claims—one based on the intent to rear the child and the other based on genetics—which in combination trump any parental claim a surrogate might make solely on the basis of her gestational relationship to the child. In instances of gestational surrogacy where the intended rearing parents supply the surrogate with an embryo that is genetically unrelated to them, codified law and case law rely solely on the intended rearing parents’ intent to establish legal parenthood. Moreover, in some states where intent is recognized as the factor which establishes parenthood, the intended rearing parents may apply for an order, prior to the baby’s birth, directing that their names rather than the names of the surrogate and her husband (if she has one) be entered on the birth certificate.

c. Assimilation

Some states that recognize surrogate parenting arrangements maintain features of adoption law in their codified-law and case-law frameworks. Typically, these states provide the surrogate with a change-of-heart period, usually around 72 hours, during which she may decide not to revoke her parental rights to the child. In the estimation of some legal theorists, intent alone does not necessarily determine rightful parenthood. They believe that the “sweat equity” of gestation should count as establishing some sort of parental claim to a child.

d. Hands-off

Nearly half of the states do not view surrogate parenting arrangements as legally enforceable. Deeming a contract for a mother unenforceable means that, if either the surrogate mother or the intended rearing parents breach the contract, the state will not intervene. The parties to the contract will need to work out their differences in custody court. So, for example, if the intended rearing parents fail to pay the surrogate mother her fee, the state will not help her collect it. Or if the intended rearing parents refuse to take the child from the surrogate mother because they no longer want the child, the state will not force them to become rearing parents. Instead, the state will require the surrogate mother either to maintain her parental relationship with the child or to put the child up for adoption. In the former case, she may be entitled to child support from the genetic or intended rearing father.

As it so happens, a non-enforcement situation is just as risky for the intended rearing parents as it is for the surrogate. If the surrogate mother refuses to relinquish the child to the intended parents, they will not be able to secure custody of the child based solely on the contract they made with the surrogate mother. However, because of the state’s interest in the well-being of the child, a family-law court will rely on the traditional “best interests of the child” standard to resolve custody disputes between the surrogate and the intended rearing parents. In cases of traditional surrogacy, virtually all family law courts will view the custody dispute as one between two genetic parents: the surrogate mother and the intended father. In cases of gestational surrogacy, some family-law courts will view the custody dispute as a conflict between the gestational mother (the surrogate mother) and the genetic mother (most typically the intended mother but in some instances an egg donor) to be decided by appeal to the original intention of the involved parties.

6. Healthcare Organizations’ and Professionals’ Attitudes toward Surrogacy Arrangements

Largely because the legal remedies for surrogacy arrangements in many states are either non-existent or ambiguous, healthcare leaders have been cautious about either total bans of or wholesale endorsements of surrogate parenting. The two main medical societies that set the gold standards for assisted-reproduction accept with some reservations surrogate parenting arrangements. The American College of Obstetrics and Gynecology (ACOG) accepts surrogacy arrangements only when they are medically necessary, and the compensation to the surrogate or gestational mother is based on her services and not on her ability to produce a child for the intended rearing parents. Adopting the assimilationist view described above, ACOG also suggests that private nonprofit agencies, similar to adoption agencies, oversee surrogacy arrangements (ACOG 1990, 133), and that subsequent to the birth of the child, the surrogate or gestational mother be given a short period of time during which she can change her mind about giving up the child.

The other main assisted-reproduction medical society, the American Society for Reproductive Medicine (ASRM), recommends that intended rearing parents avoid a traditional surrogacy arrangement and instead use a gestational surrogacy arrangement. Although the ASRM is not enthusiastic about any widespread use of surrogate mothers, it recognizes surrogacy arrangements as a way for a limited number of people to exercise their procreative freedom. Like ACOG, the ASRM frowns on assisting surrogacy arrangements unless there is a medical reason to do so.

7. Conclusion

Because the assisted-reproduction industry is regulated primarily by non-enforceable practice guidelines, assisted reproduction centers and infertility clinics usually decide their own policies and procedures for surrogacy arrangements. Some centers and clinics limit their services to infertile married couples, whereas other centers and clinics welcome anyone who can pay for their services. Limiting one’s practice to certain groups of people is sometimes a covert form of discrimination against other groups of people, however. It may be morally and legally justifiable for a center or clinic to refuse to assist people who do not have a medical reason, specifically infertility, to contract a surrogate mother. After all, physicians and nurses have no clear obligation to use their skills and/or connections to serve people who do not suffer from a disease, disability, or medical abnormality. However, when physicians and nurses refuse to help gay or lesbian individuals or couples who need to enter into a surrogacy arrangement in order to have a child, their refusal to extend help to these individuals or couples may constitute an act of discrimination.

As surrogate/contract parenting arrangements are normalized and routinized, the U.S. public will probably press federal and state authorities to pass clear legislation governing surrogacy. People in the United States view their procreative rights as sacrosanct: too important to be left to the unpredictable rulings of courts and/or the sometimes arbitrary policies of infertility clinics and assisted reproduction centers. Developing ideal laws to govern surrogate parenting arrangements will be no easy matter, however, not when a gay man can use donor sperm and donor eggs to produce embryos that are then implanted in the womb of a gestational mother. Should the law, on the basis of this gay man’s intentions alone, deem him the legal father of the child? Perhaps so, despite the fact that it will be quite some time before the majority of the U.S. population and the feminist community is comfortable with such a novel surrogate parenting arrangement.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Ali, Lorraine and Raina Kelley. “The Curious Lives of Surrogates.” Newsweek, April 7, 2008, vol. 151, Issue 14, pp. 44-51.
  • American College of Obstetricians and Gynecologists. “Ethical Issues in Surrogate Motherhood.” (ACOG Committee Opinion 88). Washington, DC: ACOG, 1990.
  • Andrews, Lori B. “The Aftermath of Baby M: Proposed Laws on Surrogate Motherhood.” In Richard T. Hull (ed.). Ethical Issues in the New Reproductive Technologies. Belmont: Wadsworth, 1990.
  • Andrews, Lori B. “Alternative Modes of Reproduction.” In Sherrill Cohen and Nadine Taub (eds.). Reproductive Laws for the 1990s. Clifton, NJ: Humana Press, 1988, pp. 361-403.
  • Andrews, Lori B. “Beyond Doctrinal Boundaries: A Legal Framework for Surrogate Motherhood.” Virginia Law Review, November 1995, 81, 2343.
  • Annas, George J. “Death without Dignity for Commercial Surrogacy: The Case of Baby M.” Hastings Center Report, 1988, vol. 18, no. 2, pp. 23-24.
  • ASRM. Third Party Reproduction (Sperm, Egg, and Embryo Donation and Surrogacy. American Society for Reproductive Medicine: Birmingham, Alabama, 2006.
  • Bayles, Michael D. “Genetic Choice.” In Richard T. Hull (ed.). Ethical Issues in the New Reproductive Technologies. Belmont: Wadsworth, 1990, pp. 241-253.
  • Binion, Gayle. “Baby M, Surrogate Parenting and Public Policy.” Policy Studies Review, Spring, 1992, vol. 11, Issue 1, pp. 126-140.
  • Capron, Alexander, and M.S. Radin. “Choosing Family Law over Contract Law as a Paradigm for Surrogate Motherhood.” Law, Medicine, and Health Care, 1988, vol. 16, no. 2, p. 3a.
  • Chesler, Phyllis. The Sacred Bond: The Legacy of Baby M. New York: Times Books, 1988.
  • Covington, Sharon N. and Linda Hammer Burns. Infertility Counseling: A Comprehensive Handbook for Clinicians. Cambridge University Press: Cambridge, 2006.
  • Daar, Judith F. “Assisted Reproductive Technologies and the Pregnancy Process: Developing and Equality Model to Protect Reproductive Liberties.” American Journal of Law and Medicine, vol. 25, no. 4, 1988, pp. 453-478.
  • Davis, Peggy C. “Alternative Modes of Reproduction: Determinants of Choice.” In Sherrill Cohen and Nadine Taub (eds.). Reproductive Laws for the 1990s. Clifton, NJ: Humana Press, 1988, pp. 421-431.
  • Ethics Committee of the American Fertility Society. “Ethical Considerations of Assisted Reproductive Technologies.” Fertility and Sterility, vol. 62, no. 5, Suppl.1, November 1994, pp. 15-125S.
  • Gentleman, Amelia. “India Nurtures Business of Surrogate Motherhood.” New York Times, March 10, 2008, A9.
  • Hull, Richard T. (ed.). Ethical Issues in the New Reproductive Technologies. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 1990.
  • In re Baby M (1988), 537 A.2d 1227, N.J.
  • Jaggar, Alison M. “Feminist Ethics.” In Lawrence Becker with Caroline Becker (eds.). Encyclopedia of Ethics. New York: Garland Press, 1993, pp. 361-370.
  • Johnson v. Calvert, 851 P. 2d., 776 (Cal. 1993), cert. denied, 1145. Ct. 206 (1993), and cert. dismissed, 114 S. Ct. 374 (1993).
  • Kass, Leon. “Making Babies Revisited.” In John Arras and Robert Hunt (eds.). Ethical Issues in Modern Medicine. Palo Alto, CA: Mayfield, 1983, pp. 407-413.
  • Ketchum, Sara Ann. “New Reproductive Technologies and the Definition of Parenthood: A Feminist Perspective.” Paper presented at Feminism and Legal Theory: Women and Intimacy, a conference sponsored by the Institute for Legal Studies at the University of Wisconsin-Madison.
  • Krimmel, Herbert T. “The Case against Surrogate Parenting.” The Hastings Center Report. October, 1983, vol. 13, no. 5, pp. 35-39.
  • Mich. Comp. Laws Ann. 722.855 (West 1993).
  • O’Brien, Mary. The Politics of Reproduction. Boston: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1981.
  • Overall, Christine. Ethics and Human Reproduction: A Feminist Analysis. Boston: Allen and Unwin, 1987.
  • Rich, Adrienne. Of Woman Born. New York: Norton, 1979.
  • Robertson, John A. “Surrogate Mothers: Not So Novel after All.” The Hastings Center Report, vol. 13, no. 5, October 1983, pp. 28-34.
  • Robertson, John A. “Assisted Reproductive Technology and the Family.” Hastings Law Journal, vol. 47, no. 4, April 1996, pp. 911-933.
  • Rothman, Barbara Katz. Recreating Motherhood Ideology and Technology in a Patriarchal Society. New York: W. W. Norton and Co., 1989.
  • Schultz, Marjorie Maguire. “Reproductive Technology and Intention-based Parenthood: An Opportunity for Gender Neutrality.” Wisconsin Law Review, 1990, vol. 2, pp. 377-378.
  • Shannon, Thomas A. and Lisa S. Cahill. Religion and Artificial Reproduction: An Inquiry into the Vatican ‘Instruction on Respect for Human Life’. New York: Crossroad, 1988.
  • Singer, Peter and Deane Wells. Making Babies: The New Science and Ethics of Conception. New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1984.
  • Spallone, Patricia and Deborah Lynn Steinberg. Made to Order: The Myth of Reproductive and Genetic Progee. Oxford: Pergamon Press, 1987.
  • Surrogacy Arrangements Act, 1985, United Kingdom, Chapter 49, p. 2. (1) (a) (b) (c).
  • United States Congress, Office of Technology Assessment. Infertility: Medical and Social Choices. Washington, DC: US Government Printing Office, 1988, OTA-BA-358.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Andrews, Lori B. Between Strangers: Surrogate Mothers, Expectant Fathers, & Brave New World Babies (New York: Harper & Row, 1989).
    • Andrews’ well-balanced and accessible examination of surrogate parenting arrangements provides many case studies, statistics, and detailed policies for readers to ponder.
  • Chesler, Phyllis. Sacred Bond: The Legacy of Baby M (New York Times Books, 1988).
    • Chesler analyzes every aspect of the Baby M case and provides a deep examination of the factors that truly make for good parents.
  • Corea, Gena. The Mother Machine: Reproductive Technologies from Artificial Insemination to Artificial Wombs (New York: Harper & Row, 1985).
    • Corea’s classic radical feminist case against all forms of assisted reproduction is accessible and spirited. Although her claims are sometimes exaggerated, she does prompt readers to consider some of the harmful consequences that might result from breaking the links between genetic, gestational, and rearing parentage.
  • Overall, Christine. Reproduction: Principles, Practices, Policies (Toronto: Oxford University Press, 1993).
    • Overall’s discussion of assisted reproduction and surrogate parenting is an excellent contribution to the literature. Its style is that of the probing philosopher with more questions than answers.
  • Robertson, John. Children of Choice: Freedom and the New Reproductive Technologies (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1994).
    • Robertson provides the best case for a nearly absolute right to procreative liberty. Strong arguments for state enforcement of properly-framed surrogate parenting arrangements can be found in his very comprehensive survey of laws governing assisted reproduction in the United States.
  • Blythe, Eric and Ruth Landau. Third Party Assisted Conception across Cultures: Social, Legal, and Ethical Perspectives (London: Jessica Kingsley Publishers, 2004).
    • Blythe and Landau provide a survey of assisted reproductive technologies throughout the world. They help readers understand why some cultures accept and others reject surrogate parenting arrangements.
  • Markens, Susan. Surrogate Motherhood and the Politics of Reproduction (Berkeley: University of California Press, 2007). Markens compares and contrasts California’s and New York’s statutes involving surrogate contracts.
    • She explores how voices on all sides of reproductive technology at times converge with regards to creating surrogate policy.
  • Shevory, Thomas C. Body/Politics: Studies in Reproduction, Production, and (Re)Construction (Westport, CT: Praeger Publishers, 2000).
    • Shevory devotes a chapter of his book to a discussion of the complex nature of surrogacy contracts.

Author Information

Rosemarie Tong
University of North Carolina, Charlotte
U. S. A.

Law and Economics

The law and economics movement applies economic theory and method to the practice of law. It asserts that the tools of economic reasoning offer the best possibility for justified and consistent legal practice. It is arguably one of the dominant theories of jurisprudence. The law and economics movement offers a general theory of law as well as conceptual tools for the clarification and improvement of its practices. The general theory is that law is best viewed as a social tool that promotes economic efficiency, that economic  analysis and efficiency as an ideal can guide legal practice.  It also considers how legislation should be used to improve market conditions  in return. Law and economics offers a framework with which to model legal outcomes, and common objectives with which to unify disparate areas of legal activity. The bringing together of legal theory and economic reasoning has also created new research agendas in the fields of behavioral economics: how rationality affects people's behavior within legal scenarios; public choice theory and how collective behavior should have an effect on legislation; and game theory: understanding strategic action in a legal context.

Table of Contents

  1. Law as an Autonomous Practice
  2. Law as a Tool to Encourage Economic Efficiency
    1. Basic Concepts in Economic Reasoning
    2. How Law Can Encourage Economic Efficiency
    3. Can All Law be Explained as Economic in Nature?
  3. Economics and Normative Jurisprudence
  4. Later Developments
    1. Behavioral Economics and Law
    2. Game Theory
    3. Public Choice Theory
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Law as an Autonomous Practice

Most traditional theories of jurisprudence look to uncover the essential or definitive aspects of the institution of law. Two of the most influential are Legal Positivism and Dworkin’s Law as Integrity. While these two differ as to their definition of law and legal reasoning, they agree upon some basic central assumptions, determining the conclusions that two philosophical investigations with largely the same aims, can reach. Because of this it is important to acknowledge some of the assumptions that are held in common by these jurisprudential stances.

First, both theories agree upon the conceptual nature of jurisprudence. Both agree that it is important for a philosophical theory of law to define the core aspects of proper legal practice in order to fulfill the function of philosophical jurisprudence. In fact, much philosophical discussion of law assumes that such a characterization is the essential aim of jurisprudence. Second in order to arrive at a properly analyzed concept of law, both legal positivism and law as integrity are best constructed from specific techniques of analytic and linguistic philosophy. These techniques include the investigation and clarification of the way people commonly speak about law and careful parsing of social practice that separate the legal from the non-legal. The third common assumption is that the best way to understand legal practice is to understand the necessary and sufficient qualities that make some rule or statement into a law. Once such a set of necessary and sufficient conditions is identified (or approximated) it is thought that the essential aspects of particularly legal practices have been understood.

Instead of following this path, theorists within the law and economics movement have attacked the study of law from another angle. Rather than trying to identify unique conceptual aspects of law, what is advocated is an investigation of legal practices through the means of economic analysis. The conclusion offered is that legal practice is best understood through its function as a social tool promoting economic efficiency, in common with other social practices.

Instead of following this path, theorists within the law and economics movement have attacked the study of law from another angle. Rather than trying to identify unique conceptual aspects of law, what is advocated is an investigation of legal practices through the means of economic analysis. The conclusion offered is that legal practice is best described by its purported function as a social tool aiming at the promotion of economic efficiency - something it has in common with other social practices.

2. Law as a Tool to Encourage Economic Efficiency

So, instead of looking for the unique and defining features of law, the practitioner of law and economics looks at law as a social tool and tries to evaluate it functionally. What is emphasized is not its uniqueness as an institution, but its place within the general and common economic structure of society. The descriptive claim most often associated with law and economics is that legal practices are best characterized as tools for encouraging economically efficient social relations. To understand this claim it is important to examine some of the basic concepts used in models of economic reasoning.

a. Basic Concepts in Economic Reasoning

Essential to an understanding of the law and economics movement is a set of fundamental concepts. The most central assumption in economics is that human beings are rational maximizers of their individual satisfactions, and, in turn, respond to incentives. A rational maximizer of personal satisfaction adjusts means to ends in the most efficient way possible. It is important to realize that economics, as understood here, is not restricted to analysis of monetary issues; there are nonmonetary as well as monetary satisfactions. Every potential satisfaction is implicated in the calculus of economic satisfactions and therefore can be investigated according to economic or means-end rationality and the trade-off of costs and benefits. Normally what is aimed at through economic reasoning is the improvement of efficiency.

A more efficient allocation is one that increases the net value of resources. Efficiency in the allocation of resources is distinguished from equity, which is concerned with justice in the distribution of wealth. Because some people value specific goods higher or lower than others, economic efficiency can often be raised through voluntary transfers of goods. The most common example of a transfer promoting efficiency is that of a freely entered into contractual relationship. Because one party to the transaction values money more than the item owned, and the other values the item owned more than the asking price, the exchange produces a net gain in economic goods. Each person ends up better off than before. Some economists have gone so far as to argue that such a contractual exchange is morally optimal because it works within both Kantian and utilitarian theories of morality. They argue that it works with Kantian theories because a contract is thought to represent a good example of interaction between free and rational agents. It works with utilitarianism because the idea of wealth maximization intuitively translates into more utility.

Economists have a variety of terms to describe possible outcomes of economic exchanges. For instance Pareto optimality is defined as a point where resources are allocated such that no one is willing to trade further. Pareto optimality is the eventual endpoint of a series of Pareto superior moves. A Pareto superior change makes at least one person better of without making anyone worse off. Because no one is worse off after the trade there are no losers in Pareto improvements, although there may be many different Pareto optimal endpoints. Furthermore, economists have developed the concept of Kaldor-Hicks efficiency to compensate for obstacles to freely contracted exchanges. Kaldor-Hicks efficiency, or potential Pareto superiority, results when the overall economic gains outweigh the losses. In other words, the gains in economic efficiency are large enough that the winners could, if they had to, compensate the losers in the new allocation of goods and still remain better off.

b. How Law Can Encourage Economic Efficiency

The law and economics movement claims that law is best understood as a tool to promote economic efficiency. But how can the institution of law help encourage efficient transactions? One way is to help avoid situations that lead to market failure. One example of market failure is the existence of monopolies: a situation where one party is able to extract more profit from a good than a healthy market would allow. Law can be used as a tool to ensure that monopoly situations are hard to bring about and maintain. Another way legal systems can be used to ensure economically efficient transactions is through the enforcement of valid contracts. By ensuring compliance with contractual terms courts can give parties to a contract confidence that the other party will fulfill the agreed-to obligations. This becomes especially important in situations where the parties must complete their obligations at different times.

But some types of market failure are less obvious, and the legal means toward remedying them subtler. One problem in market transactions is that of externalities. An externality is a cost not reflected in the market price of a good. For instance, a factory may not have to internalize the costs it imposes upon the environment into the selling price of its goods. In this case the market price of the good will not reflect its real cost – and therefore some of the costs are imposed upon parties in an involuntary manner. Pigou argues in regard to this that legal means should be used to impose a marginal tax upon the offending party, to internalize any externalities. The economist Coase argued that this conclusion, while warranted in specific cases, was too global. Coase argued that in a market where transactions are costless and people do not act strategically, rights assignments are irrelevant because from any starting point the results will be economically efficient. In other words, the Coase Theorem states that if there are no transaction costs the assignment of entitlements will be irrelevant to the goal of allocative efficiency. In such a situation there will be no need for law to internalize costs because people will bargain to the most efficient possible allocation of goods. But outside of conceptually ideal markets there are always transaction costs such as information costs, opportunity costs and administrative costs. If transaction costs are somewhat high, then it does matter how property rights are assigned. Therefore the enforcement and allocation of legal entitlements will be an important factor in ensuring economically efficient exchanges. So law can be used to encourage economic efficiency. But is all law best described in economic terms?

c. Can All Law be Explained as Economic in Nature?

It may be no real surprise that law often is used to encourage efficient exchanges. But it seems a stretch to claim that law as an institution is best completely described in economic terms. It seems counterintuitive to view all law as based upon market principles. What the economic analysis of law manages, though , is to see such disparate areas as contract, tort and criminal law as all based upon economic aims, therefore giving law a more coherent basis than other theories can offer. Richard Posner argues that tort cases - those involving private harm - can be seen as contractual by looking for the hypothetical terms that the parties to an accident would have agreed to in advance in order to bring about the accident voluntarily. Also that criminals are deterred by the threat of punishment only if the likelihood of punishment multiplied by the quantity of punishment exceeds the gain offered by the  criminal act. Scholars have been quite effective in extending the tools of economic analysis into areas that seem to be anything but economic in nature. Even rules of evidence and legal ethics have proved amenable to economic analysis. However, it may be argued that an economic explanation of law fails on two counts. Firstly as a descriptive analysis it doesn’t do justice to everyday legal conceptions. Secondly  as an analytical analysis of the necessary conditions for the practice of law  it may not be able to account for the internal point of view which Hart thought so central to a proper understanding of law. More analytical approaches to economic explanation of law have considered this a fatal flaw in the project (see Coleman 2001). This may be mistakenly importing traditional philosophical aims into a drastically different project, but the truth is that it is often hard to tell what types of theoretical claims are being made within law and economics. If the claims are of exhaustive descriptive accuracy or of the necessary and sufficient conceptual foundations of law then it is more than likely a failure. But whether or not law and economics is an accurate or even conceptually necessary description of law as a social institution, and whether or not it suffices as a complete analysis of law, it could be argued that law should in any case adopt economic efficiency as the central aim guiding judicial decision-making.

3. Economics and Normative Jurisprudence

Though analytically incomplete, economic analysis models the actual results of legal institutions better than any other theory. This does not entail, however, that law ought to be consciously used for such an aim. Might not law be better used to consider issues related to  justice, duty and the like? Advocates of law and economics have argued against such a conclusion. The arguments usually are of two types. First, it is claimed that meanings of words such as justice or duty are so vague and in dispute that the use of such concepts for a basis of judicial decisions offers no guidance whatsoever. It is argued that while such concepts are unhelpfully complex, the tools of economic analysis and the concept of economic efficiency are sufficiently clear to provide the judge a solid and predictable basis of decision. Law is better able to decide according to efficiency rather than justice or duty due to limitations of institutional competence. This might be so if issues of justice are so complex as to involve information that courts are structurally unable to process. Second, it has been argued that because the paradigm case of justice is the freely entered in to contract, law is best seen as a tool to optimize contractual arrangements. If this is so, then where law can help is in situations where transaction costs are so high as to prohibit efficient contractual relationships. Here Posner argues that law can encourage economic efficiency by assigning property rights to those parties who would have secured them through market exchange if transaction costs were lower. In other words law should bring about allocations that mimic the results of a properly functioning market. In addition, advocates of economic analysis of law make a claim that other jurisprudential traditions seem to be unable to: that the analytic tools offered by law and economics has encouraged the further creation of other productive areas for analyzing law (see Posner 1998).

4. Later Developments

Another argument for the fertility of the economic analysis of law is that it has spawned a number of further tools that seem helpful in understanding legal institutions. Three of the most important of these are the results of behavioral economics, game theory and public choice theory.

a. Behavioral Economics and Law

Practitioners of behavioral law and economics examine human limits to means-end rationality. One of the outcomes of behavioral economics is the concept of bounded rationality. Bounded rationality means that information is not processed according to a model of perfect means-end rationality but, to the contrary, is distorted due to limits of our cognitive abilities. For instance the endowment effect is thought to be a behavioral limit that distorts the proper valuation of property, an important aspect of bargaining to efficient outcomes. According to the effect, the ownership of objects creates an irrational cognitive overvaluation of them. Another claim is that our cognitive abilities are distorted by the availability heuristic. According to this the availability of strong imagery may induce us to over or underestimate the actual probability of events associated with the image. For instance, graphic representations of highly improbable harms might be more influential on behavior and demand unjustified use of resources than statistical analysis showing another equally undesirable harm to be more common and easier to avoid. Jurisprudential practices could be significantly influenced by such results. For instance, judges might be as irrationally influenced by the availability heuristic as other human beings. Therefore victim impact statements might be important correctives to proceedings if a well-presented defendant’s presence in the court skews judge or jury's decisions. An awareness of such a cognitive failure could help adjust legal reasoning and its conclusions accordingly. Finally, an awareness and exploitation of universal cognitive limits might help legislators to design more effective laws (see Sunstein 2000).

b. Game Theory

Game theory adds to economic modeling the phenomenon of strategic action. Strategic actions are those adopted because of the competitive nature of many social transactions. They are adopted due to how one individual expects another to act in response. For example, a person who wishes to buy an item cheap would act disinterested so as not to signal his or her actual desires to the seller. Addition of analytic tools dealing with strategic action greatly strengthens the economic analysis of law. For instance, the Coase theorem, to function properly, necessarily excludes strategic action; cooperation is just assumed. But it seems apparent that legal actions often are deeply implicated in and animated by strategic motives. Common sense tells us that full open cooperation is not always the best path to bringing about one’s desired results. In fact much of the bargaining invested in designing an effective contract seems to be done in the shadow of potential strategic action on the part of the contracting parties. Designing legal rules with an eye to the possibility of strategic action helps ensure that the rules will not create perverse outcomes. For instance, if a defendant’s privilege against self-incrimination could also encourage an inference of guilt from the silence the privilege would be all but useless. Therefore, courts have not only barred comment on the refusal to testify but also have required that juries, on defendant’s request, make no inference from such a choice (see Baird et al 1994). Further, the understanding that legislators might have adopted specific wording for a law based upon strategic motives may help direct the proper aims of judicial interpretation. This type of claim, though, is often better analyzed by the tools offered in public choice theory.

c. Public Choice Theory

Public choice theory is centered upon how the nature of the legislative process and collective decision making influence the nature of law. It is the application of economic models of decision-making and their results to the issues that traditionally occupy political science, for example Arrow's Theorem. One claim made within public choice theory is that a proper understanding of collective decision processes will help judges understand their position within the system. If all collective decisions are unavoidably influenced by those who get to frame the questions debated and the order of voting - the agenda-setters - public legislation will need to be interpreted differently than if it were a more neutral recording of collective wishes. Such a theoretical result makes problematic a court’s reference to the intent of the legislature.

5. References and Further Readings

  • Ackerman, Bruce, The Economic Foundations of Property Law (Boston: Little, Brown & Co., 1975)
  • Baird, Douglas, Robert Gertner and Randal Picker, Game Theory and the Law (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1994)
  • Becker, Gary S., "Nobel Lecture: The Economic Way of Looking at Behavior," 101 Journal of Political Economy 385 (1993)
  • Calabresi, Guido, The Costs of Accidents (1970)
  • Calabresi, Guido, and Douglas Melamed, "Property Rules, Liability Rules and Inalienability: One View of the Cathedral," 85 Harvard Law Review 1089 (1972)
  • Calabresi, Guido, "Some Thoughts on Risk Distribution and the Law of Torts," 70 Yale Law Journal 499 (1961)
  • Coase, Ronald, "The Problem of Social Cost," 3 Journal of Law and Economics 1 (1960)
  • Coleman, Jules, "Efficiency, Auction and Exchange: Philosophic Aspects of the Economic Approach to Law," 68 California Law Review 221 (1980)
  • Coleman, Jules, Market, Morals and the Law (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988)
  • Coleman, Jules, The Practice of Principle: In Defense of a Pragmatist Approach to Legal Theory (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2001)
  • Cotter, Thomas F., "Legal Pragmatism and the Law and Economics Movement," 84 Georgetown Law Journal 2071 (1996)
  • Farber, Daniel, and Philip Frickey, Law and Public Choice (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1991)
  • Harrison, Jeffrey L., Law and Economics (St. Paul: West Group, 1995)
  • Horwitz, Morton, "Law and Economics: Science or Politics?," 8 Hofstra Law Review 905 (1981)
  • Katz, Avery Weiner, Foundations of the Economic Approach to Law (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998)
  • Landes, William and Richard Posner, The Economic Structure of Tort Law (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1987)
  • Leff, Arthur, "Economic Analysis of Law: Some Realism About Nominalism," 60 Virginia Law Review 451 (1974)
  • Miceli, Thomas J., Economics of the Law: Torts, Contracts, Property, Litigation (1997)
  • Murphy, Jeffrie G. and Jules L. Coleman, Philosophy of Law (Boulder: Westview Press, 1990)
  • Polinsky, A. Mitchell, An Introduction to Law and Economics (Boston: Little, Brown & Company, 1989)
  • Posner, Richard A., Economic Analysis of Law (New York: Aspen, 5th ed., 1998)
  • Posner, Richard A., The Economics of Justice (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1983)
  • Posner, Richard A., Frontiers of Legal Theory (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2001)
  • Posner, Richard A., "Gary Becker's Contributions to Law and Economics," 22 Journal of Legal Studies 211 (1993)
  • "Symposium on Post-Chicago Law and Economics," 65 Chicago-Kent Law Review 1 (1989)
  • Sunstein, Cass R., Behavioral Law and Economics (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000)

Author Information

Brian Edgar Butler
University of North Carolina at Asheville
U. S. A.

Relational Models Theory

Relational Models Theory is a theory in cognitive anthropology positing a biologically innate set of elementary mental models and a generative computational system operating upon those models.  The computational system produces compound models, using the elementary models as a kind of lexicon.  The resulting set of models is used in understanding, motivating, and evaluating social relationships and social structures.  The elementary models are intuitively quite simple and commonsensical.  They are as follows: Communal Sharing (having something in common), Authority Ranking (arrangement into a hierarchy), Equality Matching (striving to maintain egalitarian relationships), and Market Pricing (use of ratios).  Even though Relational Models Theory is classified as anthropology, it bears on several philosophical questions.

It contributes to value theory by describing a mental faculty which plays a crucial role in generating a plurality of values.  It thus shows how a single human nature can result in conflicting systems of value.  The theory also contributes to philosophy of cognition.  The complex models evidently result from a computational operation, thus supporting the view that a part of the mind functions computationally.  The theory contributes  to metaphysics.  Formal properties posited by the theory are perhaps best understood abstractly, raising the possibility that these mental models correspond to abstract objects.  If so, then Relational Models Theory reveals a Platonist ontology.

Table of Contents

  1. The Theory
    1. The Elementary Models
    2. Resemblance to Classic Measurement Scales
    3. Self-Organization and Natural Selection
    4. Compound Models
    5. Mods and Preos
  2. Philosophical Implications
    1. Moral Psychology
    2. Computational Conceptions of Cognition
    3. Platonism
  3. References
    1. Specifically Addressing Relational Models Theory
    2. Related Issues

1. The Theory

a. The Elementary Models

The anthropologist Alan Page Fiske pioneered Relational Models Theory (RMT).  RMT was originally conceived as a synthesis of certain constructs concerning norms formulated by Max Weber, Jean Piaget, and Paul Ricoeur.  Fiske then explored the theory among the Moose people of Burkina Faso in Africa.  He soon realized that its application was far more general, giving special insight into human nature.  According to RMT, humans are naturally social, using the relational models to structure and understand social interactions, the application of these models seen as intrinsically valuable. All relational models, no matter how complex, are, according to RMT, analyzable by four elementary models: Communal Sharing, Authority Ranking, Equality Matching, Market Pricing.

Any relationship informed by Communal Sharing presupposes a bounded group, the members of which are not differentiated from each other.  Distinguishing individual identities are socially irrelevant.  Generosity within a Communal Sharing group is not usually conceived of as altruism due to this shared identity, even though there is typically much behavior which otherwise would seem like extreme altruism.  Members of a Communal Sharing relationship typically feel that they share something in common, such as blood, deep attraction, national identity, a history of suffering, or the joy of food.  Examples include nationalism, racism, intense romantic love, indiscriminately killing any member of an enemy group in retaliation for the death of someone in one’s own group, sharing a meal.

An Authority Ranking relationship is a hierarchy in which individuals or groups are placed in relative higher or  lower relations .  Those ranked higher have prestige and privilege not enjoyed by those who are lower.  Further, the higher typically have some control over the actions of those who are lower.  However, the higher also have duties of protection and pastoral care for those beneath them.  Metaphors of spatial relation, temporal relation, and magnitude are typically used to distinguish people of different rank. For example, a King having a larger audience room than a Prince, or a King arriving after a Prince for a royal banquet.  Further examples include military rankings, the authority of parents over their children especially in more traditional societies, caste systems, and God’s authority over humankind.  Brute coercive manipulation is not considered to be Authority Ranking; it is more properly categorized as the Null Relation in which people treat each other in non-social ways.

In Equality Matching, one attempts to achieve and sustain an even balance and one-to-one correspondence between individuals or groups.  When there is not a perfect balance, people try to keep track of the degree of imbalance in order to calculate how much correction is needed.  “Equality matching is like using a pan balance: People know how to assemble actions on one side to equal any given weight on the other side” (Fiske 1992, 691).  If you and I are out of balance, we know what would restore equality.  Examples include the principle of one-person/one-vote, rotating credit associations, equal starting points in a race, taking turns offering dinner invitations, and giving an equal number of minutes to each candidate to deliver an on-air speech.

Market Pricing is the application of ratios to social interaction.  This can involve maximization or minimization as in trying to maximize profit or minimize loss.  But it can also involve arriving at an intuitively fair proportion, as in a judge deciding on a punishment proportional to a crime.  In Market Pricing, all socially relevant properties of a relationship are reduced to a single measure of value, such as money or pleasure.  Most utilitarian principles involve maximization.  An exception would be Negative Utilitarianism whose principle is the minimization of suffering.  But all utilitarian principles are applications of Market Pricing, since the maximum and the minimum are both proportions.  Other examples include rents, taxes, cost-benefit analyses including military estimates of kill ratios and proportions of fighter planes potentially lost, tithing, and prostitution.

RMT has been extensively corroborated by controlled studies based on research using a great variety of methods investigating diverse phenomena, including cross-cultural studies (Haslam 2004b).  The research shows that the elementary models play an important role in cognition including perception of other persons.

b. Resemblance to Classic Measurement Scales

It may be jarring to learn that intense romantic love and racism are both categorized as Communal Sharing or that tithing and prostitution are both instances of Market Pricing.  These examples illustrate that a relational model is, at its core, a meaningless formal structure.  Implementation in interpersonal relations and attendant emotional associations enter in on a different level of mental processing.  Each model can be individuated in purely formal terms, each elementary model strongly resembling one of the classic scale types familiar from measurement theory.  (Strictly speaking, it is each mod which can be individuated in purely formal terms.  This finer point will be discussed in the next section.)

Communal Sharing resembles a nominal (categorical) scale.  A nominal scale is simply classifying things into categories.  A questionnaire may be designed to categorize people as theist, atheist, agnostic, and other.  Such a questionnaire is measuring religious belief by using a nominal scale.  The groups into which Communal Sharing sorts people is similar.  One either belongs to a pertinent group or one does not, there being no degree or any shades of gray.  Another illustration of nominal scaling is the pass/fail system of grading.  Authority Ranking resembles an ordinal scale in which items are ranked.  The ranking of students according to their performance is one example.  The ordered classification of shirts in a store as small, medium, large, and extra large is another.  Equality Matching resembles an interval scale.  On interval scales , any unit measures the same magnitude on any point in the scale.  For example, on the Celsius scale the difference between 1 degree and 2 degrees is the same as the difference between 5 degrees and 6 degrees.  Equality Matching resembles an interval scale insofar as one can measure the degree of inequality in a social relationship using equal intervals so as to judge how to correct the imbalance.  It is by use of such a scale that people in an Equality Matching interaction can specify how much one person owes another.  However, an interval scale cannot be used to express a ratio because it has no absolute zero point.  For example, the zero point on the Celsius scale is not absolute so one cannot say that 20 degrees is twice as warm as 10 degrees while on a Kelvin scale because the zero point is absolute one can express ratios.  Given that Market Pricing is the application of ratios to social interactions, it resembles a ratio scale such as the Kelvin scale.  One cannot, for example, meaningfully speak of the maximization of utility without presupposing some sort of ratio scale for measuring utility.  Maximization would correspond to 100 percent.

c. Self-Organization and Natural Selection

The four measurement scales correspond to different levels of semantic richness and precision.  The nominal scale conveys little information, being very coarse grained.  For example, pass/fail grading conveys less information than ranking students.  Giving letter grades is even more precise and semantically rich, conveying how much one student out-performs another.  This is the use of an interval scale.  The most informative and semantically rich is a percentage grade which illustrates the ratio by which one student out-performs another, hence a ratio scale.  For example, if graded accurately a student scoring 90 percent has done twice as well as a student scoring 45 percent.  Counterexamples may be apparent: two students could be ranked differently while receiving the same letter grade by using a deliberately coarse-grained letter grading system so as to minimize low grades.  To take an extreme case, a very generous instructor might award an A to every student (after all, no student was completely lost in class) while at the same time mentally ranking the students in terms of their performance.  Split grades are sometimes used to smooth out the traditional coarse-grained letter grading system .  But, if both scales are as sensitive as possible and based on the same data, the interval scale will convey more information than the ordinal scale.  The ordinal ranking will be derivable from the interval grading, but not vice versa.  This is more obvious in the case of temperature measurement, in which grade inflation is not an issue.  Simply ranking objects in terms of warmer/colder conveys less information than does Celsius measurement.

One scale is more informative than another because it is less symmetrical; greater asymmetry means that more information is conveyed.  On a measurement scale, a permutation which distorts or changes information is an asymmetry.  Analogously, a permutation in a social-relational arrangement which distorts or changes social relations is an asymmetry.  In either case, a permutation which does not carry with it such a distortion or change is symmetric.  The nominal scale type is the most symmetrical scale type, just as Communal Sharing is the most symmetrical elementary model.  In either case, the only asymmetrical permutation is one which moves an item out of a category, for example, expelling someone from the social group.  Any permutation within the category or group makes no difference; no difference to the information conveyed, no difference to the social relation.  In the case of pass/fail grading, the student’s performance could be markedly different from what it actually was.  So long as the student does well enough to pass (or poorly enough to fail), this would not have changed the grade.  Thanks to this high degree of symmetry, the nominal scale conveys relatively little information.

The ordinal scale is less symmetrical.  Any permutation that changes rankings is asymmetrical, since it distorts or changes something significant.  But items arranged could change in many respects relative to each other while their ordering remains unaffected, so a high level of symmetry remains.  Students could vary in their performance, but so long as their relative ranking remains the same, this would make no difference to grades based on an ordinal scale.

An interval scale is even less symmetrical and hence more informative, as seen in the fact that a system of letter grades conveys more information than does a mere ranking of students.  An interval scale conveys the relative degrees of difference between items.  If one student improves from doing C level work to B level work, this would register on an interval scale but would remain invisible on an ordinal scale if the change did not affect student ranking.  Analogously, in Equality Matching, if one person, and one person only, were to receive an extra five minutes to deliver their campaign speech, this would be socially significant.  By contrast, in Authority Ranking, the addition of an extra five minutes to the time taken by a Prince to deliver a speech would make no socially significant difference provided that the relative ranking remains undisturbed (for example, the King still being allotted more time than the Prince, and the Duke less than the Prince).

In Market Pricing, as in any ratio scale, the asymmetry is even greater.  Adding five years to the punishment of every convict could badly skew what should be proportionate punishments.  But giving an extra five minutes to each candidate would preserve balance in Equality Matching.

The symmetries of all the scale types have an interesting formal property.  They form a descending symmetry subgroup chain.  In other words, the symmetries of a ratio scale form a subset of the symmetries of a relevant interval scale, the symmetries of that scale form a subset of the symmetries of a relevant ordinal scale, and the symmetries of that scale form a subset of the symmetries of a relevant nominal scale.  More specifically, the scale types form a containment hierarchy.  Analogously, the symmetries of Market Pricing form a subset of the symmetries of Equality Matching which form a subset of the symmetries of Authority Ranking which form a subset of the symmetries of Communal Sharing.  Descending subgroup chains are common in nature, including inorganic nature.  The symmetries of solid matter form a subset of the symmetries of liquid matter which form a subset of the symmetries of gaseous matter which form a subset of the symmetries of plasma.

This raises interesting questions about the origins of these patterns in the mind: could they result from spontaneous symmetry breakings in brain activity rather than being genetically encoded?  Darwinian adaptations are genetically encoded, whereas spontaneous symmetry breaking is ubiquitous in nature rather than being limited to genetically constrained structures.  The appeal to spontaneous symmetry breaking suggests a non-Darwinian approach to understanding how the elementary models could be “innate” (in the sense of being neither learned nor arrived at through reason).  That is, are the elementary relational models results of self-organization rather than learning or natural selection?  If they are programmed into the genome, why would this programming imitate a pattern in nature which usually occurs without genetic encoding?  The spiral shape of a galaxy, for example, is due to spontaneous symmetry breaking, as is the transition from liquid to solid.  But these transitions are not encoded in genes, of course.  Being part of the natural world, why should the elementary models be understood any differently?

d. Compound Models

While all relational models are analyzable into four fundamental models, the number of models as such is potentially infinite.  This is because social-relational cognition is productive; any instance of a model can serve as a constituent in an even more complex instance of a model.  Consider Authority Ranking and Market Pricing; an instance of one can be embedded in or subordinated to an instance of the other.  When a judge decides on a punishment that is proportionate to the crime, the judge is using a ratio scale and hence Market Pricing.  But the judge is only authorized to do this because of her authority, hence Authority Ranking.  We have here a case of Market Pricing embedded in a superordinate (as opposed to subordinate) structure of Authority Ranking resulting in a compound model.  Now consider ordering food from a waiter.  The superordinate relationship is now Market Pricing, since one is paying for the waiter’s service.  But the service itself is Authority Ranking with the customer as the superior party.  In this case, an instance of Authority Ranking is subordinate to an instance of Market Pricing.  This is also a compound model with the same constituents but differently arranged.  The democratic election of a leader is Authority Ranking subordinated to Equality Matching.  An elementary school teacher’s supervising children to make sure they take turns is Equality Matching subordinated to Authority Ranking.

A model can also be embedded in a model of the same type.  In some complex egalitarian social arrangements, one instance of Equality Matching can be embedded in another.  Anton Pannekoek’s proposed Council Communism is one such example.  The buying and selling of options is the buying and selling of the right to buy and sell, hence recursively embedded Market Pricing.  Moose society is largely structured by a complex model involving multiple levels of Communal Sharing.  A family among the Moose is largely structured by Communal Sharing, as is the village which embeds it, as is the larger community that embeds the village, and so on.  In principle, there is no upper limit on the number of embeddings in a compound model.  Hence, the number of potential relational models is infinite.

e. Mods and Preos

A model, whether elementary or compound, is devoid of meaning when considered in isolation.  As purely abstract structures, models are sometimes known as “mods” , which is an abbreviation of, “cognitively modular but modifiable modes of interacting” (Fiske 2004, 3).  (This may be a misnomer, since, as purely formal structures devoid of semantic content, mods are not modes of social interaction any more than syntax.   is a communication system.)  In order to externalize models, that is, in order to use them to interpret or motivate or structure interactions, one needs “preos,” these being “socially transmitted prototypes, precedents, and principles that complete the mods, specifying how, when and with respect to whom the mods apply” (2004, 4).  Strictly speaking, a relational model is the union of a mod with a preo.  A mod has the formal properties of symmetry, asymmetry, and in some cases embeddedness.  But a mod requires a preo in order to have the properties intuitively identifiable as meaningful, such as social application, emotional resonance, and motivating force.

The notion of a preo updates and includes the notion of an implementation rule, from an earlier stage of relational-models theorizing.  Fiske has identified five kinds of implementation rules (1991, 142).  One kind specifies the domain to which a model applies.  For example, in some cultures Authority Ranking is used to structure and give meaning to marriage.  In other cultures, Authority Ranking does not structure marriage and may even be viewed as immoral in that context.  Another sort of implementation rule specifies the individuals or groups which are to be related by the model.  Communal Sharing, for example, can be applied to different groups of people.  Experience, and sometimes also agreement, decides who is in the Communal Sharing group.  In implementing Authority Ranking, it is not enough to specify how many ranks there are.  One must also specify who belongs to which rank.  A third sort of implementation rule defines values and categories.  In Equality Matching, each participant must give or receive the same thing.  But what counts as the same thing?  In Authority Ranking, a higher-up deserves honor from a lower-down, but what counts as honor and what constitutes showing honor?  There are no a priori or innate answers to these questions; culture and mutual agreement help settle such matters.  Consider the principle of one-person/one-vote, an example of Equality Matching.  Currently in the United States and Great Britain, whoever gets the most votes wins the election.  But it is also possible to have a system in which a two-thirds majority is necessary for there to be a winner.  Without a two-thirds majority, there may be a coalition government, a second election with the lowest performing candidates eliminated, or some other arrangement.  These are different ways of determining what counts as treating each citizen as having an equal say.  A fourth determines the code used to indicate the existence and quality of the relationship.  Authority Ranking is coded differently in different cultures, as it can be represented by the size of one’s office, the height of one’s throne, the number of bars on one’s sleeve, and so forth.  A fifth sort of implementation rule concerns a general tendency to favor some elementary models over others.  For example, Market Pricing may be highly valued in some cultures as fair and reasonable while categorized as dehumanizing in others.  The same is clearly true of Authority Ranking.  Communal Sharing is much more prominent and generally valued in some cultures than in others.  This does not mean that any culture is completely devoid of any specific elementary model but that some models are de-emphasized and marginalized in some cultures as compared to others.  So the union of mod and preo may even serve to marginalize the resulting model in relation to other models.

The fact that the same mod can be united with different preos is one source of normative plurality across cultures, to be discussed in the next section.  Another source is the generation of distinct compound mods.  Different cultures can use different mods, since there is a considerable number of potential mods to choose from.

2. Philosophical Implications

a. Moral Psychology

Each elementary model crucially enters into certain moral values.  An ethic of service to one’s group is a form of Communal Sharing.  It is an altruistic ethic in some sense, but bear in mind that all members of the group share a common identity.  So, strictly speaking, it is not true altruism.  Authority Ranking informs an ethic of obedience to authority including respect, honor, and loyalty.  Any questions of value remaining to be clarified are settled by the authority; subordinates are expected to follow the values thus dictated.  Fairness and even distribution are informed by Equality Matching.  John Rawls’ veil of ignorance exemplifies Equality Matching; a perspective in which one does not know which role one will play guarantees that one aim for equality.  Gregory Vlastos has even attempted to reduce all distributive justice to a framework that can be identified with Equality Matching.  Market Pricing informs libertarian values of freely entering into contracts and taking risks with the aim of increasing one’s own utility or the utility of one’s group.  But this also includes suffering the losses when one’s calculations prove incorrect.  Utilitarianism is a somewhat counterintuitive attempt to extend this sort of morality to all sentient life, but is still recognizable as Market Pricing.  It would be too simple, however, to say that there are only four sorts of values in RMT.  In fact, combinations of models yield complex models, resulting in a potential infinity of complex values.  Potential variety is further increased by the variability of possible preos.  This great variety of values leads to value conflicts most noticeably across cultures.

RMT strongly suggests value pluralism, in Isaiah Berlin’s sense of “pluralism”.  The pluralism in question is a cultural pluralism, different traditions producing mutually incommensurable values.  Berlin drew a distinction between relativism and pluralism, even though there are strong similarities between the two.  Relativism and pluralism both acknowledge values which are incommensurable, meaning that they cannot be reconciled and that there is no absolute or objective way to judge between them.  Pluralism, however, acknowledges empathy and emotional understanding across cultures.  Even if one does not accept the values of another culture, one still has an emotional understanding of how such values could be adopted.  This stands in contrast to relativism, as defined by Berlin.  If relativism is true, then there can be no emotional understanding of alien values.  One understands the value system of an alien culture in essentially the same manner as one understands the behavior of ants or, for that matter, the behavior of tectonic plates; it is a purely causal understanding.  It is the emotionally remote understanding of the scientist rather than the empathic understanding of someone engaging, say, with the poetry and theatre of another culture.  Adopting RMT, pluralism seems quite plausible.  Given that one has the mental capacity to generate the relevant model, one can replicate the alien value in oneself.  One is not simply thinking about the foreigner’s relational model, but using one’s shared human nature to produce that same model in oneself.  This does not, however, mean that one adopts that value, since one can also retain the conflicting model characteristic of one’s own culture.  One’s decisive motivation may still flow wholly from the latter.

But the significance of RMT for the debate over pluralism and absolutism may be more complex than indicated above.  Since RMT incorporates the view that people perceive social relationships as intrinsic values, this may indicate that a society which fosters interactions and relationships is absolutely better than one which divides and atomizes, at least along that one dimension.  This may be an element of moral absolutism in RMT, and it is interesting to see how it is to be reconciled with any pluralism also implied.

b. Computational Conceptions of Cognition

The examples of embedding in Section 1.d. not only illustrate the productivity of social-relational cognition, but also its systematicity.  To speak of the systematicity of thought means that the ability to think a given thought renders probable the ability to think a semantically close thought.  The ability to conceive of Authority Ranking embedding Market Pricing makes it highly likely that one can conceive of Market Pricing embedding Authority Ranking.  One finds productivity and systematicity in language as well.  Any phrase can be embedded in a superordinate phrase.  For example, the determiner phrase [the water] is embedded in the prepositional phrase [in [the water]], and the prepositional phrase [in [the water]] is embedded in the determiner phrase [the fish [in [the water]]].  The in-principle absence of limit here means that the number of phrases is infinite.  Further, the ability to parse (or understand) a phrase renders very probable the ability to parse (or understand) a semantically close phrase.  For example, being able to mentally process Plato did trust Socrates makes it likely that one can process Socrates did trust Plato as well as Plato did trust Plato and Socrates did trust Socrates.  Productivity and systematicity, either in language or in social-relational cognition, constitute a strong inductive argument for a combinatorial operation that respects semantic relations.  (The operation respects semantic relations, given that the meaning of a generated compound is a function of the meanings of its constituents and their arrangement.)  In other words, it is an argument for digital computation.

This is essentially Noam Chomsky’s argument for a computational procedure explaining syntax (insofar as syntax is not idiomatic).  It is also essentially Jerry Fodor’s argument for computational procedures constituting thought processes more generally.  That digital computation underlies both complex social-relational cognition and language raises important questions.  Are all mental processes largely computational or might language and social-relational cognition be special cases?  Do language and social-relational cognition share the same computational mechanism or do they each have their own?  What are the constraints on computation in either language or social-relational cognition?

c. Platonism

Chomsky has noted the discrete infinity of language.  Each phrase consists of a number of constituents which can be counted using natural numbers (discreteness), and there is no longest phrase meaning that the set of all possible phrases is infinite.  Analogous points apply to social-relational cognition.  The number of instances of an elementary mod within any mod can be counted using natural numbers.  In the case discussed earlier in which a customer is ordering food from a waiter, there is one instance of Authority Ranking embedded in one instance of Market Pricing.  The total number of instances is two, a natural number.  There is no principled upper limit on the number of embeddings, hence infinity.  The discrete infinity of language and social-relational cognition is tantamount to their productivity.

However, some philosophers, especially Jerrold Katz, have argued that nothing empirical can exhibit discrete infinity.  Something empirical may be continuously infinite, such as a volume of space containing infinitely many points.  But the indefinite addition of constituent upon constituent has no empirical exemplification.  Space-time, if it were finite in this sense, would contain only finite energy and a finite number of particles.  There are not infinitely many objects, as discrete infinity would imply.  On this reasoning, the discrete infinity of an entity can only mean that the entity exists beyond space and time, still assuming that space-time is finite.  This would mean that sentences, and by similar reasoning compound mods as well, are abstract objects rather than neural features or processes.  This would mean that mods and sentences are abstract objects like numbers.  One finds here a kind of Platonism, Platonism here defined as the view that there are abstract objects.

As a tentative reply, one could say that the symbols generated by a computational system are potentially infinite in number, but this raises questions about the nature of potentiality.  What is a merely potential mod or a merely potential sentence?  It is not something with any spatiotemporal location or any causal power.  Perhaps it is sentence types (as contrasted with tokens) that exhibit discrete infinity.  And likewise with mods, it is mod types that exhibit discrete infinity.  But here too, one is appealing to entities, namely types, that have no spatiotemporal location or causal power.  By definition, these are abstract objects.

The case for Platonism is perhaps stronger for compound mods, but one could also defend the same conclusion with regard to the elementary mods.  Each elementary mod, as noted earlier, corresponds to one of the classic measurement scales.  Different scale types are presupposed by different logics.  Classical two-valued logic presupposes a nominal scale, as illustrated by the law of excluded middle: a statement is either on the truth scale, in which case it is true, or off the scale, in which case it is false.  Alternatively, one could posit two categories, one for true and one for false, and stipulate that any statement belongs on one scale or the other.  Fuzzy logics conceive truth either in terms of interval scales, for example, it is two degrees more true that Michel is bald than that Van is bald, or in terms of ratio scales, for example, it is 80 percent true that Van is bald, 100 percent true that Michel is bald.  Even though it has perhaps not been formalized, there is intuitively a logic which presupposes an ordinal scale.  A logic, say,  in which it is more true that chess is a game than that Ring a Ring o’ Roses is a game, even though it would be meaningless to ask how much more.  If nominal, ordinal, interval, and ratio scales are more basic than various logics, then the question arises as to whether they can seriously be considered empirical or spatiotemporal.  If anything is Platonic, then something more basic than logic is likely to be Platonic.  And what is an elementary mod aside from the scale type which it “resembles”?  Is there any reason to distinguish the elementary mod from the scale type itself?  If not, then the elementary mods themselves are abstract objects, at least on this argument.

Does reflection upon language and the relational models support a Platonist metaphysic?  If so, what is one to make of the earlier discussion of RMT appealing, as it did, to neural symmetry breakings and mental computations?  If mods are abstract objects, then the symmetry breakings and computations may belong to the epistemology of RMT rather than to its metaphysics.  In other words, they may throw light on how one knows about mods rather than actually constituting the mods themselves.  Specifically, the symmetry breaking and computations may account for the production of mental representations of mods rather than the mods themselves.  But whether or not there is a good case here for Platonism is, no doubt, open to further questioning.

3. References

a. Specifically Addressing Relational Models Theory

  • Bolender, John. (2010), The Self-Organizing Social Mind (Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press).
    • Argues that the elementary relational models are due to self-organizing brain activity.  Also contains a discussion of possible Platonist implications of RMT.
  • Bolender, John. (2011), Digital Social Mind (Exeter, UK: Imprint Academic).
    • Argues that complex relational models are due to mental computations.
  • Fiske, Alan Page. (1990), “Relativity within Moose (‘Mossi’) culture: four incommensurable models for social relationships,” Ethos, 18, pp. 180-204.
    • Fiske here argues that RMT supports moral relativism, although his “relativism” may be the same as Berlin’s “pluralism.”
  • Fiske, Alan Page. (1991), Structures of Social Life: The Four Elementary Forms of Human Relations (New York: The Free Press).
    • The classic work on RMT, containing the first full statement of the theory and a wealth of anthropological illustrations.
  • Fiske, Alan Page. (1992), “The Four Elementary Forms of Sociality: Framework for a Unified Theory of Social Relations,” Psychological Review, 99, 689-723.
    • Essentially, a shorter version of Fiske’s (1991).  Nonetheless, this is a detailed and substantial introduction to RMT.
  • Fiske, Alan Page. (2004), “Relational Models Theory 2.0,” in Haslam (2004a).
    • An updated introduction to RMT.
  • Haslam, Nick. ed. (2004a), Relational Models Theory: A Contemporary Overview (Mahwah, New Jersey and London: Lawrence Erlbaum).
    • An anthology containing an updated introduction to RMT as well as discussions of controlled empirical evidence supporting the theory.
  • Haslam, Nick. ed. (2004b), “Research on the Relational Models: An Overview,” in Haslam (2004a).
    • Reviews controlled studies corroborating that the elementary relational models play an important role in cognition including person perception.
  • Pinker, Steven. (2007), The Stuff of Thought: Language as a Window into Human Nature (London: Allen Lane).
    • Argues that Market Pricing, in contrast to the other three elementary models, is not innate and is somehow unnatural.

b. Related Issues

  • Berlin, Isaiah. (1990), The Crooked Timber of Humanity: Chapters in the History of Ideas. Edited by H. Hardy (London: Pimlico).
    • A discussion of value pluralism in the context of history of ideas.
  • Fodor, Jerry A. (1987), Psychosemantics: The Problem of Meaning in the Philosophy of Mind (Cambridge, Mass. and London: MIT Press).
    • The Appendix argues that systematicity and productivity in thought require a combinatorial system.  The point, however, is a general one, not specifically focused on social-relational cognition.
  • Katz, Jerrold J. (1996), “The unfinished Chomskyan revolution,” Mind & Language, 11 (3), pp. 270-294.
    • Argues that only an abstract object can exhibit discrete infinity.
  • Rawls, John. (1971), A Theory of Justice (Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press).
    • The veil of ignorance illustrates Equality Matching.
  • Szpiro, George G. (2010), Numbers Rule: The Vexing Mathematics of Democracy, from Plato to the Present (Princeton: Princeton University Press).
    • Illustrates various ways in which Equality Matching can be implemented.
  • Stevens, S. S. (1946), “On the Theory of Scales of Measurement,” Science 103, pp. 677-680.
    • A classic discussion of the types of measurement scales.
  • Vlastos, Gregory. (1962), “Justice and Equality,” in Richard B. Brandt, ed. Social Justice (Englewood Cliffs, New Jersey: Prentice-Hall).
    • An attempt to understand all distributive justice in terms of Equality Matching.

Author Information

John Bolender
Middle East Technical University

Global Ethics: Capabilities Approach

The capabilities approach is meant to identify a space in which we can make cross-cultural judgments about ways of life. The capabilities approach is radically different from, yet indebted to, traditional ethical theories such as virtue ethics, consequentialism and deontology.

This article begins with a background on global ethics. This situates the capabilities approach as a possible solution to the problems that arise from globalization. The second section provides Amartya Sen's account of the basic framework of the capabilities approach. That section also shows how Martha Nussbaum develops the approach. The third section describes Nussbaum's list of ten central capabilities. This list has been viewed by some philosophers as a definitive list, while others, notably Sen, have argued that no list is complete, because a list should always be subject to revision. The fourth section shows how the approach is similar to, yet very different from, traditional ethical theories such as virtue ethics, consequentialism and deontology. The capabilities approach is shown to add to the approaches of global ethics such as communitarianism, human rights, and the approach of John Rawls. The section compares Michael Boylan's table of embeddedness with Nussbaum's capabilities list. The fifth section discusses two main philosophical critiques of the capabilities approach. First, and most notably, Alison Jaggar criticizes Nussbaum for not paying closer attention to asymmetrical power relations. Second, Bernard Williams raises questions about what constitutes a capability. The sixth section shows how the capabilities approach has been applied to advance various areas of applied philosophy including the environment and disability ethics. The final section explains how the capabilities approach has been undertaken as a global endeavor by the United Nations Development Program to fight poverty and illiteracy and to empower women.

Table of Contents

  1. Background of Global Ethics
  2. The Capabilities Approach
    1. Sen
    2. Nussbaum
  3. Nussbaum's List of Central Capabilities
  4. The Relationship between the Capabilities Approach and Other Ethical Theories
    1. Virtue Ethics
    2. Communitarianism
    3. Deontology
    4. Rawls' The Law of Peoples
    5. Human Rights
    6. Consequentialism
    7. Boylan’s Table of Embeddedness
  5. Philosophical Criticisms of the Capabilities Approach
    1. Illiberal and Neo-Colonialist
    2. What Is a Capability?
  6. Philosophical Applications
    1. The Environment
    2. Disability Ethics
  7. United Nations Development Program
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Background of Global Ethics

Issues of globalization have sparked great controversy since the 1980s. Globalization, broadly construed, is manifested in various forms of social activity including economic, political and cultural life. Practicing global ethics entails moral reasoning across borders. Borders can entail culture, religion, ethnicity, gender, race, class, sexuality, global location, historical experience, environment, species and nations. Ethicists ask how we best address issues of globalization–that is, how we begin to address conflicts that arise when vastly different cultural norms, values, and practices collide.


There have been two broad philosophical approaches to address cross-border moral disagreement and conflict. The dominant approach aims to develop moral theories that are not committed to a single metaphysical world-view or religious foundation, but are compatible with various perspectives. In other words, it is a goal to develop a theory that is both ‘thick’ (that is, it has a robust conception of the good embedded within a particular context, and respects local traditions) and ‘thin’ (that is, it embraces a set of universal norms). These universalists include human rights theorists, Onora O’Neill’s deontology, Seyla Benhabib’s discourse ethics and Martha Nussbaum’s capabilities approach. They tend to be associated with constructing ‘thin’ theories of morality. The other approach, most notably advocated by Michael Walzer, is communitarianism. Communitarians deny the possibility of developing a single universal standard of flourishing that is both thick enough to be useful and thin enough to support reasonable pluralism.


The debate between these two approaches to global ethics has reached an impasse. Since communitarians hold that moral norms are always local and valid internal to a particular community, universalists charge the communitarians with relativism. Moreover, universalists argue that communitarians fail to provide useful methods for addressing cross-border moral conflict. However, the communitarians charge the universalists with either positing theories that are too thin to be useful or advancing theories that are substantive but covertly build in premises that are not universally shared, and so risk cultural imperialism.


Martha Nussbaum believes her capabilities theory resolves the impasse and offers a viable approach to global ethics that provides a universal measure of human flourishing while also respecting religious and cultural differences. The capabilities approach, she argues, is universal, but 'of a particular type.' That is, it is a thick (or substantive) theory of morality that accommodates pluralism. Thus, she argues that her theory avoids criticisms applied to other universalists and communitarians. Before examining her theory, we must address her predecessor, Amartya Sen.

2. The Capabilities Approach

a. Sen

Amartya Sen, an economic theorist and founder of the capabilities approach, developed his theory in order to identify a space in which we can make cross cultural judgments on the quality of life. To best understand how these judgments can be passed, we must investigate a critical distinction made by proponents of the capabilities approach–between function and capability. A function, on the one hand, according to Sen, is an achievement, but this should be broadly understood to include any 'state of being.' Let's examine Sen's bike-riding example to shed light on a 'function.' He says a bicyclist has achieved the purpose of what one does with a bike–namely, ride it. From this example, clearly the choice to ride a bike is a function of a human being, however, the scope of functioning is not merely limited to a person's intention to ride the bike. A 'function' entails any 'state of being' which includes excitement, happiness and fear. For example, a child who first begins to ride her bike may display a great amount of fear as she wobbles down the road, but once she understands how to ride the bike smoothly, she can enjoy (or perhaps become excited) riding her bike. Thus, when the child rides her bike (and is excited from doing so), she has performed the functions of riding a bike, and having the emotions associated with doing so, while partaking in the capability of play.

A capability, on the other hand, is a possibility, not just any possibility, but a real one. For example, we can talk about the possibility of a person in a deeply poverty-stricken area to find employment and support a family. However, such a possibility may not be real considering external circumstances–for example, no clothing, food or shelter. Put differently, a 'capability set' (as Sen calls it) is the total functions available for a person to perform.  By describing it in such a way, Sen places a deep correlation between freedom and function. That is to say, the more limited one's freedom, the less opportunities one has to fulfill one's functions. In sum, Crocker (2008) says succinctly that, according to Sen, a capability X entails (1) having the real possibility for X which (2) depends on my powers and (3) and no external circumstances preventing me from X.

A capability and function should not be understood as mutually exclusive or completely paralleling one another. Let's consider two people with the same capabilities. Even though they have same capabilities, they may participate in radically different functions. For example, two people may both have the opportunity to engage in play, but do so in radically different ways (for example, one may swim while the other volunteers at a homeless shelter). Proponents of the capabilities approach argue this makes the theory most attractive, that is, it accommodates various ways of life even though it puts forth a conception of the good. Now, let's consider a situation in which people participate in the same functions, but possess different capabilities set. Consider Sen's example of hunger. Two people may be hungry, but for radically different reasons. Consider, on the one hand, a person who seeks to fulfill her desire to eat, but cannot because of socio-economic circumstances.  On the other, a person may be hungry because she is fasting for religious reasons or protesting an injustice. In both examples, the person suffers from starvation, but for radically different reasons.

b. Nussbaum

Nussbaum begins her capabilities approach by noting her indebtedness to Aristotle and Karl Marx (and to a lesser extent, J.S. Mill). Like Sen, she embraces the capabilities/function distinction. However, she begins to part ways with Sen’s philosophy when she grounds her theory in Marx and Aristotle. In doing so she argues that a function must not be performed in just any way, but in a 'truly human way.' That is to say, if a person lives a life where she is unable to exercise her human powers (for example, self-expressive creativity) then she is living her life in more of an animalistic manner than as a human being.

Nussbaum seeks a capabilities approach that can fully express human powers and not just provide (real) opportunities for people to perform certain functions. In other words, she does not deny, as Sen argues, that a capability is a real possibility or opportunity for an individual to perform certain actions, but that is merely necessary and not sufficient for the capabilities approach. Sen is missing, according to Nussbaum, aspects of what is particularly unique to human beings, that is, human powers. Nussbaum understands the capabilities/function distinction as multiply realized–that is, while the capabilities are the space for the opportunity for particular actions, the way in which that space is manifested, via different actions, is a person's functioning.

Nussbaum notes that there are three specific differences that sets her capabilities approach apart from Sen. First, Nussbaum (2000) charges Sen with not explicitly rejecting cultural relativism. She agrees with his sympathies for universal norms, she also, criticizes his inability to completely reject cultural relativism. Second, Nussbaum criticizes Sen for not grounding his theory in a Marxian/Aristotelian idea of true human functioning. This is not to say that he would reject Nussbaum's conclusions drawn from Marx and Aristotle, but rather he is not specifically indebted to (and does not ground his theory in) them.  Third, Sen does not provide an explicit list of central capabilities As a matter of fact, Sen has been critical of attempting to provide a list of central capabilities. Nonetheless, these three points of division seem to separate Sen and Nussbaum.

Nussbaum's two philosophical justifications are the non-Platonic substantive good approach (that is, intuitionism) and a limited role of proceduralism (that is, discourse ethics)–which are a point of contention amongst critics. According to the former, the primary justification for the capabilities approach, we test various ethical theories against our fixed intuitions and decide which theory best matches them. Nussbaum contends that the theory that best represents our intuitions is the capabilities approach. The intuition that grounds the capabilities, according to Nussbaum, is the intuition of a dignified human life whereby people have the capability to pursue their conception of the good in cooperation with others. Consider her example of a person's fixed intuition that rape is damaging to human dignity. She claims if one matches that intuition against all ethical theories that it will be best represented by the capabilities approach.

One may have reservations for this justification in situations where a person has underdeveloped (that is, intuitions that have not been challenged by competing intuitions) or mistaken intuitions. In response, Nussbaum argues that underdeveloped and mistaken intuitions must be rejected, and replaced with diversely experienced people who have tested their intuitions against competing beliefs. Although Nussbaum notes the primacy of intuitionism, she also argues that proceduralism has an ancillary justification for the capabilities approach.

Nussbaum's proceduralism begins not with an intuition, but with a decision procedure, and it is the procedure that confers justification on the outcome. She is sympathetic to this form of proceduralism since it is rooted in Kantian discourse ethics (adopted by Jean Hampton), and has accordingly built into it a conception of equal human worth. In that sense proceduralism is similar to the intuitionist justification. However, there are stark contrasts. What is proceduralism, then? The version Nussbaum is concerned with claims that one consults the desires or preferences of another who is impacted by the outcome of the decision at hand. Similar to the concern above, Nussbaum fears that many people's desires (like intuitions) will be corrupt, and thus produce a morally repugnant conclusion. Therefore, she seeks not just any desires, but 'informed desires,' that is, desires constructed by treating people with dignity. However, because not all desires are informed, and yet proceduralism calls for us to consult all desires affected by the decision, the capabilities approach would be placed on too weak of a foundation. Thus, in virtue of all the mistaken desires, proceduralism merely plays an ancillary role. Yet, it's fair to say that if everyone had informed desires, then Nussbaum would grant proceduralism as a primary justification for the capabilities approach.

These two justifications are meant to be mutually reinforcing. They are meant to justify both the capabilities approach qua theory and the particular list of central capabilities put forth by Nussbaum. However, due to the limitations Nussbaum places on proceduralism, we must rely on intuitionism as the main justification.

3. Nussbaum's List of Central Capabilities


There is much debate over whether Nussbaum's list of central capabilities is revisable, and thus subject to change, or whether it is a fixed set of capabilities that cannot be compromised. Earlier in her career, Nussbaum (1995) argued that her list was static, however, she has since backed off such a claim and acknowledged the possibility that they could be altered. From her book, Women and Human Development: The Capabilities Approach (WHD hereafter), here is her list of capabilities, along with a brief description of each.

1. Life – Able to live to the end of a normal length human life, and to not have one's life reduced to not worth living.

2. Bodily Health – Able to have a good life which includes (but is not limited to) reproductive health, nourishment and shelter.

3. Bodily Integrity – Able to change locations freely, in addition to, having sovereignty over one's body which includes being secure against assault (for example, sexual assault, child sexual abuse, domestic violence and the opportunity for sexual satisfaction).

4. Senses, Imagination and Thought – Able to use one's senses to imagine, think and reason in a 'truly human way'–informed by an adequate education. Furthermore, the ability to produce self-expressive works and engage in religious rituals without fear of political ramifications. The ability to have pleasurable experiences and avoid unnecessary pain. Finally, the ability to seek the meaning of life.

5. Emotions – Able to have attachments to things outside of ourselves; this includes being able to love others, grieve at the loss of loved ones and be angry when it is justified.

6. Practical Reason – Able to form a conception of the good and critically reflect on it.

7. Affiliation

A. Able to live with and show concern for others, empathize with (and show compassion for) others and the capability of justice and friendship. Institutions help develop and protect forms of affiliation.

B. Able to have self-respect and not be humiliated by others, that is, being treated with dignity and equal worth. This entails (at the very least) protections of being discriminated on the basis of race, sex, sexuality, religion, caste, ethnicity and nationality. In work, this means entering relationships of mutual recognition.

8. Other Species – Able to have concern for and live with other animals, plants and the environment at large.

9. Play – Able to laugh, play and enjoy recreational activities.

10. Control over One's Environment

A. Political – Able to effectively participate in the political life which includes having the right to free speech and association.

B. Material – Able to own property, not just formally, but materially (that is, as a real opportunity). Furthermore, having the ability to seek employment on an equal basis as others, and the freedom from unwarranted search and seizure.

Even though Nussbaum claims each of the ten capabilities is equally important, she places special emphasis on two of them–namely, practical reason and affiliation. We see the importance when she explicitly says the core behind the intuition of human functioning is that of a dignified free person who constructs her way of life in reciprocity with others, and not merely following, or being shaped by, others. Furthermore, Nussbaum notes that these two capabilities suffuse all the others, and this in turn, constitutes a truly human pursuit.

Furthermore, Nussbaum argues that the list is 'thick,' but 'vague.' It is thick because it provides a specific conception of the good life (that is, human flourishing), however, it is not thick enough that it mandates how one ought to live one's life. Thus, the capabilities list is 'thick' enough to allow us to make cross-cultural judgments (for example, identifying areas where an individual or groups of people are unable to actualize a capability), and yet 'vague' enough for an individual to choose whether or not (or how) she wishes to participate in a capability.

Finally, Nussbaum says that citizens should be guaranteed a social minimum whereby capabilities can be realized. It is the role of institutions to ensure that a threshold level of central capabilities is achieved. Institutions (for example, religious, labor, government, and so forth) come in many forms, and protect various interests. For example, the Self Employed Women's Association (SEWA) helps women provide protection and benefits for work in which they have been traditionally underappreciated. However, as Nussbaum notes, achieving the threshold may not be enough for justice.

4. The Relationship between the Capabilities Approach and Other Ethical Theories

The ethical theories that have dominated Western philosophy include (in one form or another) virtue ethics, consequentialism and deontology. The capabilities cannot be reduced to any of those ethical theories, however, it is indebted more or less to each of them. This section will review Rawls and human rights, both of which have numerous deontological underpinnings, and communitarianism which is closely linked with ethics. Finally, this section will include a section on Michael Boylan's 'table of embeddedness' in order to see the challenges and parallels between it and Nussbaum's list of capabilities. This section will explore parallels and differences between the capabilities approach and the above ethical theories.

a. Virtue Ethics

Even though there are clear differences between the virtue tradition (specifically, Aristotle) and the capabilities approach, Nussbaum uses the former as a point of departure. That is, Aristotle is the foundation for the capabilities approach because Nussbaum seeks a theory that provides the opportunity for human beings to use their powers to flourish in a truly human way.

Virtue ethics, broadly speaking, like the capabilities approach, claims human beings should exercise their powers qua human in attempt in order to live well. Contemporary neo-Aristotelians strive to explicate an account of flourishing  which may entail providing a naturalistic account of flourishing or through empirical psychology. Nussbaum, however, interprets Aristotle's account of functioning as merely a moral concept and not naturalistic). However, unlike other neo-Aristotelians (and Aristotle himself), Nussbaum has no intention of providing a comprehensive doctrine of human flourishing, although, as noted above, she believes she is providing a tentatively comprehensive list of capabilities.

There is another stark contrast between virtue ethics and the capabilities approach–namely, character building and motivation. Nussbaum is less concerned with why people perform certain actions, and building one's character over a period of time through proper motivations, and more concerned with providing the proper space that allows an individual to use her powers to fulfill a capability, if she chooses. One should not mistake this claim to mean that Nussbaum is not concerned with motivation at all, but rather this should be viewed as a shift in emphasis. Nussbaum argues in WHD that informed desires (that is, the justification for the capabilities approach) cannot be any desire, but those which contribute to living well. For example, even though one may fulfill the capability of practical reason through education, one should not use it in such a way that coerces others. Such a desire would be condemned by Nussbaum since, on the one hand, it prevents the coerced person from participating in all the capabilities, and on the other, it does not reflect an informed one.

b. Communitarianism

Communitarianism is a critique of liberal theory, and, on the other, emphasizes the importance of political norms within a community. In brief, liberal theorists contend that a self is ahistorical, asocial and apolitical.  Thus it is not necessarily the case that it will be burdened by the practices and beliefs of its community. Michael Sandel, a nationalist-communitarian, explains that a liberal self is 'unencumbered'–that is, it is not wedded to a particular conception of the good not of its choosing. This abstract ontology allows liberals to make certain moves in the political sphere. For example, the concept of 'justice' entails universal normative claims since all human beings are ontologically the same.

In contrast, Alasdair MacIntyre, a communitarian indebted to Aristotle, argues against liberal political theory beginning with their conception of the self. He says a self is embedded within a particular set of cultural beliefs, practices and history. MacIntyre, following Aristotle, claims that in order for one to live a good life, one must be virtuous. A virtue, according to MacIntyre (2007), is a character trait that allows us to achieve goods that are internal to one’s practices By 'practice,' he is referring to a "socially established cooperative human activity through which goods internal to that form of activity are realized in the course of trying to achieve those standards of excellence...."  Thus, living a good life entails being virtuous within the context of a given practice (or community).

Furthermore, communitarians believe justice is limited to communities rather than human beings at large. This, in turn, allows them to reject the notion that we can make universal normative judgments. Finally, MacIntyre believes we need extend our conception of virtue from the individual to the community. It’s a bit unclear what a virtuous community would look like exactly, however, we know that it would have a conception of the good life in which people strive. This is clearly contrary to the liberal project in which, , individuals pursue whatever conception of the good they wish as long as they do not interfere or harm another.

Nussbaum is sympathetic to communitarianism insofar as it acknowledges the importance of local traditions and practices that shape our lives. For example, a Hindi woman in India will have a set of beliefs that shape who she is that differs from a Protestant male in the United States. However, Nussbaum ultimately rejects communitarianism. In her section entitled "Defending Universal Values" from WHD, she says communitarians fail to recognize that there is a conception of the individual that is not indebted to a particular metaphysical tradition. She argues that each person should be treated as an end, worthy of respect, dignity and honor. As mentioned in section II, Nussbaum believes the capabilities is founded on the intuition that each person is worthy of a dignified life, and this intuition holds irrespective of one's community.

c. Deontology

In putting forth her ancillary justification for the capabilities, Nussbaum is indebted to Jean Hampton's Kantian proceduralism. Nussbaum (2000) believes we need a "Kantian conception of human worth that prominently includes the ideas of equal worth and nonaggregation" (Nussbaum's italics,). There are two points to take from this claim. First, she is indebted to the Kantian notion that all human beings have intrinsic worth, and as a result, they should always be treated as an end and never merely as a means. Second, she is critiquing the consequentialist argument for aggregate utility. We saw her specific problems with this argument immediately above.

Although Nussbaum is clearly indebted to deontology since it is a justification (albeit auxiliary) for the capabilities, there remains questions to what extent Kant plays a role. David Crocker (2008) argues that her Kantian equal-worth commitment is nothing more than an addition onto her Aristotelianism since the latter justifies moral and political inequality.

d. Rawls' The Law of Peoples


John Rawls uses the same methodology (and preserves the liberal ontological framework of ‘autonomy’ and ‘reason’) in The Law of Peoples as in A Theory of Justice however, he has extended justice to a global scale rather than merely nationally. Beginning with the 'global original position,' Rawls argues that all reasonable (or decent) persons would construct political ideals that benefit all liberal peoples; these ideals would be reached via overlapping consensus. See Daniels (1989) and Pogge (1989) for further discussion on Rawls' original position. A liberal, democratic society, according to Rawls (1999), would include the following benefits: (1) fair equality of opportunity–including, education, (2) a decent distribution of income, (3) society as employer of last resort through general or local government, (4) basic health care for all citizens and (5) public financing of elections (p. 50).

Rawls (1999) claims that the policies constructed by liberal peoples should direct non-liberal societies to (ideally) all become liberal. Rawls deems an illiberal society which rejects the possibility of becoming liberal (for example, abiding by human rights regulations) as an 'outlaw state.' While liberal societies should attempt to tolerate illiberal societies initially, he contends an outlaw state eventually subjects itself to severe sanctions and possible intervention

Nussbaum is indebted to not only Rawls specifically, but often praises the values of liberalism. First, she is committed to Rawls' method of 'overlapping consensus' insofar as it is politically advantageous to perform such tasks as fairly distributing primary goods. Furthermore, Nussbaum (2000) respects Rawls attentiveness to "pluralism and paternalism" while remaining committed to the importance of basic liberties Finally, Nussbaum agrees with Rawls (and liberalism more generally) that we should treat people as dignified human beings, and respect their autonomy qua individual.

Nussbaum is also critical of Rawls beginning with his reluctance to make comparisons of well-being. Rawls refuses to make comparisons since each person constructs their conception of the good, so a person may be satisfied with their way of life even though another may find it unsatisfactory. While there may be fears of paternalism, Nussbaum is clear that we should make comparisons of well-being in order to grant certain areas as needing more resources than others. From this, Nussbaum (2000) criticizes Rawls for not taking seriously enough how greatly individuals vary in their needs. Consider her example. If we are concerned with spending resources on increasing literacy rates around the world, we will have to spend much more on women than men given the discrepancy between them. However, Nussbaum argues that Rawls’ approach could not properly address the obstacles when distributing resources since he is merely concerned with resource-distribution, and not cognizant of the variations of distribution within a particular region.

e. Human Rights

The rhetoric of human rights has arguably been more powerful than any other approach to global justice. There is debate amongst human rights advocates in regards to the origin of rights, how they are manifested (that is, who possess them), their possibility of group distribution and how they ought to be enforced. Nonetheless, human rights are universal political norms that belong to every individual simply in virtue of being human. It does not matter whether one belongs to one affiliation or another; but merely in virtue of being a human being, she is guaranteed minimal norms (for example, the right to life or liberty). These are minimal insofar as they are not connected with any conception of the good life, and thus, do not preclude any groups of people (or communities). For further discussion on the nature of human rights see Griffin (2008) and Donnelly (2003).

Alan Gewirth, in The Community of Rights, attempts to make human rights compatible with communities. We can see the difficulty of such a task given the commitment the communitarianism theorists have to a common good, on the one hand, and a value-neutral approach from rights, on the other. Nonetheless, Gewirth argues that if a community does not uphold a doctrine of human rights, then it ought to be rejected as a legitimate community. Gewirth puts forth a theory of human rights while respecting the role communities play in our lives. Furthermore, Will Kymlicka (1989) extends the concept of rights by constructing a theory of rights that considers communities or group rights.

In WHD, Nussbaum directly addresses the "very close" relationship between human rights and the capabilities approach. She believes the capabilities approach has advantages over human rights insofar as it can take a clear position on issues the latter cannot in addition to providing a clear goal. For example, human rights theorists often disagree on the origin and foundation of rights, whereas the capabilities approach, according to Nussbaum, is not plagued by such criticisms. She raises two concerns for why we should reject human rights in favor of the capabilities approach, and then provides four key roles for human rights.

Nussbaum first claims that human rights proponents often make rights claims in regards to property or economic advantage (for example, they have a right to shelter). However, in converting a language of rights to capabilities, she explains that this statement becomes problematic insofar as it can be understood in many ways including resources, utility and capabilities. The human rights tradition would discuss it in terms of resources; however, merely providing resources does not necessarily raise everyone to the same level of capability in order to allow them to fulfill their function. Second, the language of capability ethics does not contain all the baggage that pertains to human rights.  Although Nussbaum rejects the understanding that human rights are often characterized as simply being Western, she also says the capabilities approach avoids the troubles surrounding this debate.

Even though Nussbaum is critical of human rights, she believes is plays an essential role in global ethics. She presents the following four roles (or advantages) of human rights. First, human rights have the advantage of showing the urgency to claims of injustice. Second, human rights (as of now) have rhetorical power. Third, human rights place value on people's autonomy. Finally, human rights preserve a sense of agreement insofar as it purports norms that apply to everyone.

f. Consequentialism

It would be easy to mistake the capabilities approach as a consequentialist argument to increase the overall utility in the world, where 'utility' can be understood in many ways–including 'happiness.' Peter Singer (1972), in his influential work, "Famine, Affluence and Morality," puts forth arguments fighting global poverty from a consequentialist standpoint. In sum, he argues through a series of objections and replies that those in positions of material power should donate to those in less favorable conditions in order to increase the overall utility (and ultimately decrease poverty) throughout the world. It can be said that that Singer's consequentialism and the capabilities approach are similar insofar as they both more or less seek to directly reduce poverty, and furthermore, provide more opportunities for those who have few or none.

However, Nussbaum (2000) provides three reasons for why consequentialism is different from the capabilities approach. First, one major difference is for whom the ethical theory accounts. On the one hand, consequentialism is interested in maximizing the utility of everyone (that is, the aggregate). On the other, the capabilities approach is interested in the individual. For example, Nussbaum says that the aggregative solution does not tell us who are the bottom and top, that is, who has control over material goods and whether or not someone else deserves a share of it. Thus, by focusing on the individual, we are able to best identify who needs resources and how much.

Second, related to the above point, consequentialism tends to ignore cross-cultural differences, that is, ignoring the fact that people live vastly different lives. As consequentialism is concerned with overall utility (and not merely particular persons or groups of people), it may ignore a particular good that is minimized in one culture, but widely present in another. Put differently, there are many goods–including education and religion–that are highly important to some and relatively unimportant to others. Consequentialism aggregates all goods under the heading of 'utility,' and thus, we are unable to identify which goods must be properly distributed to a particular region. The capabilities approach, however, is not only interested in allowing groups of people to use their power to fulfill a capability, but in each individual person to partake in a capability.

Finally, consequentialism ignores relevant aspects of individuals including emotions (that is, how individuals feel about what is happening to them) and what they are able to do or be (that is, fulfill a capability). This critique tends to be associated with consequentialism at large (and not specifically from the capabilities approach), but it is still worth noting. Since the capabilities strive for human flourishing, which entails the ability to express emotions without fear, we can understand why Nussbaum reiterates this critique.

g. Boylan’s Table of Embeddedness

Michael Boylan, in A Just Society, presents a 'table of embeddedness,' which is meant to describe a hierarchy of goods. Boylan's argument for the table can be seen as follows: if people desire to be good, and becoming good requires action, then all people desire to act; the following table presents the interconnectedness between Boylan's preconditions for actions and a hierarchy of goods.

Boylan (2004) splits the table into two levels–basic goods and secondary goods. The former, on the one hand, is broken further into 'most deeply embedded' goods (for example, food, clothing, shelter and free from being harmed) and 'deeply embedded' goods (for example, literate, basic math skills, treated with self-respect, and so forth). On the other hand, Boylan divides the latter into 'life enhancing' goods (for example, societal respect, equal opportunity and equal political participation), 'useful' goods (for example, property, gain from one's labor and pursue goods owned by the general public such as a cell phone) and 'luxurious' goods (for example, pursue pleasant goods such as vacationing and use one's will to possess a large portion of society's resources). Even though society has no duty to provide 'useful' or 'luxurious' goods, it has an obligation to provide basic goods and life enhancing goods (from the secondary goods) to its members. Finally, in striving for equal respect, Boylan claims society may have to spend greater resources on those who are disadvantaged; in doing so Nussbaum would be sympathetic to Boylan's claim that some groups of people require disproportionally more resources given their unfortunate circumstances than another. This was her critique of Rawls–namely, that he did not account for the varying needs of individuals. Furthermore, Nussbaum would also grant that society has an obligation to provide its citizens with Boylan's basic goods such as food, shelter and water. However, the roles in which each list plays will be different given how their respective authors understand its purpose.

Nussbaum's list, unlike Boylan’s, is not hierarchal, but rather everyone ought to have equal opportunity to perform a function that fulfills a capability. In other words, no capability, according to Nussbaum, is more essential than another. Marcus Düwell (2009) provides two criticisms of this view. First, he claims a lack of hierarchy of goods (or capabilities) raises concerns about its practical guidance in "morally contested topics." Even though Nussbaum argues that no primacy should be given to a particular capability, it's worth noting that it would be difficult to fulfill the capability of 'bodily integrity,' for example, if one's capability of life is taken away. Second, it also raises concerns to what extent the capabilities are "foundational moral obligations for others."

5. Philosophical Criticisms of the Capabilities Approach

The capabilities approach has endured many criticisms since its inception. The primary critique is constructed from the feminist and non-Western perspective. This entry will focus on Alison Jaggar's critique since it embodies many concerns of power relations. Meanwhile, the latter critique can be found in many theorists, but the focus of this entry will be limited to Bernard Williams since he puts forth two challenges in attempt to seek the nature of a capability. Jaggar's criticisms are limited to Nussbaum, and Williams' critique is directed primarily towards Sen. This will provide a greater array of criticisms for the capabilities theory in general.

a. Illiberal and Neo-Colonialist

Alison Jaggar criticizes both Nussbaum's justifications for the capabilities approach and her list. Jaggar believes Nussbaum may have ignored power asymmetries that exist between not only men and women, but also Western and non-Western peoples. She argues that the intuitionist and proceduralist justifications seem to be neo-colonialist and illiberal.

First, Jaggar (2006) argues that Nussbaum's theory appears to be neo-colonialist insofar as those in power have the "final assess the moral worth of...[other's] voices". This is problematic for the intuitionist justification since those who possess intuitions that do not match the capabilities list, for example, will be interpreted and possibly jettisoned. Put differently, there are no mechanisms in Nussbaum's approach that allow us to encourage self-criticism from those who possess the list. Furthermore, Jaggar emphasizes that Nussbaum is committed to a politically liberal project (that is, considering everyone's intuitions), however, the intuitionist justification paradoxically dismisses ideas that do not match the theory put forth by Nussbaum, and thus, it illiberally disregards others. In order for Nussbaum’s theory to encourage self-criticism, she must include all intuitions.

Second, the capabilities list seems to be illiberal since "other voices" (that is, mistaken or uninformed desires) are not ready for a proceduralist justification. Since Nussbaum demands only informed desires participate in the proceduralist justification for the list, desires that do not match the list will be unable to partake in the discourse. Furthermore, because these voices are silenced, there may be capabilities missing from the list or capabilities on the list that ought to be challenged. Regardless, they will be left untouched.

In sum, Jaggar criticizes Nussbaum's justifications for the capabilities approach since they ignore asymmetrical power relationships. Jaggar believes that even though Nussbaum claims to be paying attention to such relations, she paradoxically fails to produce a theory that yields an outcome that is cognizant of power. It's worth noting, though, that Jaggar does not believe these criticisms ultimately entail rejecting the capabilities. Rather, she believes that placing discourse ethics as the main justification for the capabilities may allow the theory to be self-critical, and thus, fully aware of power dynamics.

b. What Is a Capability?

Williams' (1987) primary concern of the capabilities approach is trying to understand what is meant by a 'capability.' In pursuing this inquiry, he believes Sen in particular, but capabilities proponents in general, are unclear on the relationship between 'choice' and 'capability.' Williams does not provide knock-down arguments against the capabilities, but rather poses two challenges for the capabilities theorist to consider.

First, Williams asks what it means to have the capability to do X? Consider his example. If a person is posted once a year to a desirable holiday resort, does she have the capability to go? In a trivial sense, "yes," but not in a meaningful way (that is, in a way that contributes to the well-being of an individual). If the term 'capability' is understood merely as 'possibility,' then it could be granted that she has the capability to go, although, there is still something missing–namely, the ability to choose whether or not to go. This example is meant to illustrate the correlation between capabilities and choice. That is, according to Williams, in this case a capability cannot exist without the option to choose it. However, consider Sen's example where a capability exists without the ability to choose it. Sen, in his Tanner Lectures, notes that the life expectancy is higher in China than India. He believes this example shows that the higher one's life expectancy the higher the capability of a standard of living. In response to this claim William asks, what capability is increased by a greater life expectancy? He poses this question since it might be the case that living longer only contributes to one having more time to contemplate whether to commit suicide. In this example, Williams is pointing out the problems with the relationship of a capability that completely lacks choice.

Second, and related to the above challenge, William questions the relationship of the capability of doing X to the actual ability to do X here and now. He notes that the 'actual ability to do X' can be understood as 'can do X.' In other words, if a person possesses the capability to do X, then it must be the case that she can do X. Consider Sen's example of the capability of breathing unpolluted air. He would argue that if a person has the capability to breathe unpolluted air, then she can do so. Williams grants that a person living in Los Angeles cannot breathe unpolluted air here and now, however, that is not to say she cannot do so at all. In other words, this person has the capability to breathe unpolluted air, but she cannot do it here and now; this position is contrary, though, to Sen's claim above that if one has the capability to do X, she can do X. Because she has the capability to breathe unpolluted air, she should move to a place where it is possible to do so. Williams argues, though, that there are large costs associated with moving to a place where she can breathe unpolluted air. Let's assume that person does not have the economic means to do so. Does this person really have the capability, then, to breathe unpolluted air?–logically speaking, "yes," however, certainly not in any meaningful sense. By considering the opportunity costs associated with a capability such as breathing unpolluted air, some capabilities may become nearly impossible for many to acquire. Thus, Williams argues it is not simply because one can do X that one has the capability to do X.

6. Philosophical Applications

The capabilities approach is often discussed in terms of providing opportunities (Sen) and using human powers (Nussbaum). More often than not it is an argument to reduce poverty or increase the well-being of people around the globe. Recently, it has provided the framework to further advance arguments in other areas of applied ethics including business ethics, the environment, disability ethics and animal ethics. This entry will merely focus on the environment and disability ethics because it calls attention to how far the capabilities approach can be extended.

a. The Environment

The biggest challenge facing capabilities theorists in regards to the environment is on the area of emphasis. The goal of the capabilities–whether Sen or Nussbaum–is human flourishing or well-being. It is never simply understood as non-human or ecological flourishing. Of course, this is not to say that the capabilities approach has nothing to say about the environment, or worse, that it must harm it in order for human beings to flourish, although, there are obstacles standing in the way when putting forth not only an environmentally friendly capabilities approach, but one in which environmental flourishing is taken just as seriously as human flourishing.

There seems to be two ways in which we can approach environmental ethics from a capabilities perspective. By briefly examining each solution, we will have a broader perspective of how the capabilities approach begins to asses environmental concerns. First, one may begin with the capabilities list, and show how environmental values relate to human flourishing. Recall Nussbaum's eighth capability (out of ten): Other species have the ability to have a concern for and live with others animals, plants and the environment at large. There are two points we can take from this capability. First, Nussbaum believes the environment clearly plays a role in human flourishing otherwise she would not have included it as a capability. Even though the environment seems to be playing an instrumental role insofar as it contributes to human flourishing, it is nonetheless an essential capability. Furthermore, Nussbaum's list is beneficial because she believes it should be implemented as public policy which would force countries that do not take the environmental capability seriously to reconsider their current policies. Second, however, Victoria Kamsler (2006) recalls that she places it eighth on the list which, she argues, is hard to deny that it is given less emphasis than on almost all the other capabilities. In defense of Nussbaum, she notes that all the capabilities are meant to be mutually reinforcing, and thus, the dignity of a human being as truly human cannot be met without taking environment flourishing seriously.

Second, rather than starting with the list and placing instrumental value on the environment, one may begin with a general account of flourishing that can be applied to non-human beings such as animals and the environment. Here, the environment is understood as being intrinsically valuable (that is, valuable independent of human beings). Kamsler notes that Nussbaum believes the "most basic intuition behind [the] capability theory... 'wants to see each thing flourish as the sort of thing that it is'". In other words, the environment qua capability must be treated as an entity that must flourish in its own right, and not merely for the value it provides human beings.

There still remains a lingering question about the relationship between the environment and the capabilities approach. If the capability is understood as anthropocentric insofar as it is concerned with human flourishing, what should we do when the environment impedes such flourishing? In other words, there seem to be cases in which being concerned with the environment's flourishing will directly conflict with human flourishing (for example, the capability of work and protecting forests). Kamsler addresses this conflict when she says that the only way to overcome this seemingly tragic dilemma is through technological and political means. This is not to say that it will not be costly or conflict with other capabilities, but it is a solution that goes beyond being complacent with the dilemma.

b. Disability Ethics

A person cannot be said to flourish, according to the capabilities approach, if she is unable to perform functions that partake in the capabilities. This raises interesting questions with people who have disabilities insofar as they may be either physically or mentally impaired from having the ability to perform many functions. Nussbaum has given this topic ample discussion through her Tanner Lectures and various publications.

Nussbaum addresses the question of disabilities via the capabilities approach through her list. Her early formulation of the capabilities list excluded many people from the ability to live a truly human life since she required such a life to include using all five senses, for example. She has since retracted from such bold statements. However, Nussbaum (1995) does note that it would be difficult to imagine a person living a truly human life with total lack of the senses, imagination and reasoning.

Nussbaum (2002) has extended her account of functioning in a truly human way (that is, for human dignity) "as containing many different types of animal dignity, all of which deserve respect and even wonder". In other words, she believes the mentally disabled can gain dignity not merely from rationality, but also through support for the "capabilities of life, health, and bodily integrity. It will also provide stimulation for senses, imagination and thought" This passage indicates a clear responsibility on the state to not only allow for such stimulation of the senses to occur, but to actually provide the resources for such stimulation to occur.

There are interesting questions about how to implement policies that provide the best opportunity for disabled peoples to perform functions that fulfill capabilities. Nussbaum heralds the Individuals with Disabilities Education Act (IDEA) as a way to understand how the capabilities can be manifested in the current education system. IDEA is a disabilities act that begins with the idea of human individuality. Instead of lumping all disabled students into one group, each student is taken on a case-by-case basis. This approach in turn, allows for each student to receive the proper care she needs. This Act does not focus on education being a 'human right' because that would entail the goal of merely providing an education to the student, that is, ensuring she receives an education in one form or another. What makes this Act uniquely indebted to the capabilities is its commitment to providing the opportunity for the students to use their powers qua human beings to fulfill their functions in a truly human way–for example, via their senses, imagination and thought.

7. United Nations Development Program

The UNDP is an organization built on the theoretical principles of the capabilities approach. Its goals include helping countries best address solutions pertaining to democratic governance, poverty reduction, crisis prevention and recovery, environment and energy and HIV/AIDS. The organization is clear that none of these solutions will ever come at the expense of women since they are an advocate of empowering women. The four solutions listed here are designed to assist the various challenges facing nations. However, there are eight concrete goals the UNDP is interested in achieving.

The UNDP has put forth eight Millennium Development Goals (MDGs). The MDGs include the following: (1) eradicate extreme poverty and hunger, (2) achieve universal primary education, (3) promote gender equality and empower women, (4) reduce child mortality, (5) improve maternal health, (6) combat HIV/AIDS, malaria and other diseases, (7) ensure environmental sustainability and (8) develop a global partnership for development. The success or failure of achieving these goals is based on a measurement from the Human Development Report (HDR).

The HDR is designed to measure the ways in which people can live up to their full potential in accordance with their desires and interests. Mahbub ul Haq, founder of the HDR, says "the basic purpose of development is to enlarge people's choices...[which include] greater access to knowledge, better nutrition and health services, more secure livelihoods, security against crime and physical violence, satisfying leisure hours, political and cultural freedoms and sense of participation in community activities." There are two points to take from this. First, it is clear that the theoretical aspects of the capabilities approach have been preserved upon measuring the MDGs. Second, the HDR is not committed to merely measuring wealth, but rather providing the opportunities for a person to fulfill any of the capabilities she is interested in pursuing.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Appiah, Kwame A. (2006) Cosmopolitanism: Ethics in a World of Strangers, W.W. Norton: NY.
  • Benhabib, Seyla (1995) "Cultural Complexity, Moral Interdependence, and the Global Dialogical Community" in Women, Culture and Development, Martha C. Nussbaum and Jonathan Glover (eds.), Clarendon Press: Oxford.
  • Boylan, Micahel (2004) A Just Society, Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc: Lanham, MD.
  • Crocker, David (2008) Ethics of Global Development: Agency, Capability and Deliberative Democracy, Cambridge University Press: NY.
  • Daniels, Norman (1989) Reading Rawls: Critical Studies on Rawls' "A Theory of Justice," Stanford University Press: Stanford, CA.
  • Donnelly, Jack (2003) Universal Human Rights in Theory and Practice, Cornell University Press: Ithaca.
  • Düwell, Marcus (2009) "On the Possibility of a Hierarchy of Moral Goods," in Morality and Justice: Reading Boylan's A Just Society, John-Steward Gordon (ed.), Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc: Lanham, MD.
  • Gewirth, Alan (1978) Reason and Morality, The University of Chicago Press: Chicago, IL.
  • Gewirth, Alan (1996) The Community of Rights, The University of Chicago Press: Chicago, IL.
  • Griffin, James (2008) On Human Rights, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
  • Jaggar, Alison (2006) "Reasoning About Well-Being: Nussbaum's Methods of Justifying the Capabilities," The Journal of Political Philosophy, 14:3, 301-322.
  • Kymlicka, Will (1989) Liberalism, Community and Culture, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair (1988) Whose Justice? Which Rationality?, University of Notre Dame Press, Notre Dame, IN.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair (2007) After Virtue, Notre Dame University Press: Notre Dame, IN.
  • Nussbaum, Martha (1995), "Human Capabilities, Female Human Beings," in Women, Culture, and Development: A Study of Human Capabilities, Martha C. Nussbaum and Jonathan Glover (eds.), Clarendon Press: Oxford.
  • Nussbaum, Martha (2000) Women and Human Development: The Capabilities Approach, Cambridge University Press: Cambridge, MA.
  • Nussbaum, Martha (2002) "Capabilities and Disabilities: Justice for Mentally Disabled Citizens," Philosophical Topics, 30:2, 133-165.
  • O’Neill, Onora (1996) Towards Justice and Virtue: A Constructive Account of Practical Reason, Cambridge University Press: Cambridge, MA.
  • Pogge, Thomas W. (1989) Realizing Rawls, Cornell University Press, Ithaca.
  • Rawls, John (1999) A Theory of Justice, Harvard University Press: Cambridge, MA.
  • Rawls, John (1999) The Law of Peoples, Harvard University Press: Cambridge, MA.
  • Sandel, Michael (1996) Democracy's Discontent: America in Search of a Public Philosophy, Harvard University Press: Cambridge, MA.
  • Sandel, Michael J. (1982) Liberalism and the Limits of Justice, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.
  • Sen, A. K. (1985) "Well-being, Agency and Freedom: the Dewey Lectures," Journal of Philosophy, 82:4, 169-221.
  • Sen, Amartya K. (1987) The Standard of Living: The Tanner Lectures, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sen, Amartya (2009) The Idea of Justice, Harvard University Press: Cambridge, MA.
  • Singer, Peter (1972) "Famine, Affluence, and Morality," Philosophy and Public Affairs, 1:1, 229-243.
  • Kamsler, Victoria (2006) "Attending to nature: capabilities and the environment," in Capabilities Equality: Basic issues and problems (ed.) Alexander Kaufman, Routledge: NY, 198-213.
  • Williams, Bernard (1987), "The Standard of Living: Interests and Capabilities," in The Standard of Living (ed.), Geoffrey Hawthorn, Cambridge University Press: Cambridge, 94-102.

Author Information

Chad Kleist
Marquette University
U. S. A.

Autonomy: Normative

Autonomy is variously rendered as self-law, self-government, self-rule, or self-determination. The concept first came into prominence in ancient Greece (from the Greek auto-nomos), where it characterized city states that were self governing. Only later–during the European Enlightenment–did autonomy come to be widely understood as a property of persons. Today the concept is used in both senses, although most contemporary philosophers deal with autonomy primarily as a property of persons.  This orientation will be maintained here.

Most people would agree that autonomy is normatively important. This agreement is reflected both in the presence of broad assent to the principle that autonomy deserves respect, and in the popular practice of arguing for the institution (or continuation, or discontinuation) of public policy based in some way on the value of self-determination. Many also believe that developing and cultivating autonomy is an important–indeed, on some accounts, an indispensable–part of living a good life. But although the claim that autonomy is normatively significant in some way is intuitively compelling, it is not obvious why autonomy has this significance, or what weight autonomy-based considerations should be given in relation to competing normative considerations. In order to answer these questions with sufficient rigor, it is necessary to have a more detailed understanding of what autonomy is.

This article will be devoted to canvassing the leading work done by philosophers on these two issues, beginning with the question of the nature of autonomy, and then moving to the question of the normative significance of autonomy. It will be seen that autonomy has been understood in several different ways, that it has been claimed to have normative significance of various kinds, and that it has been employed in a wide range of philosophical issues. Special attention will be paid to the question of justification of the principle of respect for autonomous choice.

Table of Contents

  1. History of the Concept of Autonomy
  2. Conceptions of Autonomy
    1. Moral Autonomy
    2. Existentialist Autonomy
    3. Personal Autonomy
    4. Autonomy as a Right
  3. The Normative Roles of Autonomy
    1. Autonomy in Ethical Theory
    2. Autonomy in Applied Ethics
    3. Autonomy in Political Philosophy
    4. Autonomy in Philosophy of Education
  4. Warrant for the Principle of Respect for Autonomous Choice
  5. References and Further Reading

1. History of the Concept of Autonomy

The concept of autonomy first came into prominence in ancient Greece, where it characterized self-governing city-states. Barring one exception (mentioned below), autonomy was not explicitly predicated of persons, although there is reason to hold that many philosophers of that time had something similar in mind when they wrote of persons being guided or ruled by reason. Plato and Aristotle, for example–as well as many of the Stoics–surely would have agreed that a person ruled by reason is a properly self-governing or self-ruling person. What one does not find, however, are ancient philosophers speaking of the ideal of autonomy as that of living according to one’s unique individuality. The one exception to this appears to be found in the thinker and orator Dio of Prusa (ca. 50–ca. 120), who, in his 80th Discourse, clearly seems to predicate autonomy of individual persons in roughly the sense in which it has come to be understood in our own day (see Cooper 2003).

Medieval philosophers made no use of the concept of autonomy that is worthy of note, although once again, many medieval philosophers would have doubtless agreed that those who live in accordance with right reason and the will of God are properly self-governing. The concept of autonomy wouldn’t be circulated in learned circles again until the Renaissance and early modern times, when it was employed both in the traditional political sense, and in an ecclesiastical sense, to refer to churches that were–or at least claimed to be –independent of the authority of the Roman Catholic Pope (see Pohlmann 1971).

The concept of autonomy came into philosophical prominence for the first time with the work of Immanuel Kant. Kant’s work on autonomy, however, was strongly influenced by the writings of Jean-Jacques Rousseau, so a brief word on Rousseau is in order.  Although Rousseau did not use the term ‘autonomy’ in his writings, his conception of moral freedom–defined as “obedience to the law one has prescribed to oneself”– has a clear relation to Kant’s understanding of autonomy (as will be shown below). Moreover, Rousseau wrote of moral freedom as a property of persons, thus presaging Kant’s predication of autonomy of persons. The connections between Rousseau and Kant cannot be taken too far, however; for Rousseau was primarily concerned with the question of how moral freedom can be achieved and sustained by individuals within society given the presence of relations of social dependency and the possibility of domination, whereas Kant was primarily concerned with the place of autonomy in accounts of the subjective conditions requisite for, and the nature of, morality. Because of the connections Kant drew between autonomy and morality, Kant’s conception of autonomy is sometimes referred to as ‘moral autonomy’.

In the nineteenth century, John Stuart Mill contributed to the discussion on the normative significance of autonomy in his work On Liberty. Although Mill did not use the term ‘autonomy’ in this work, he is widely understood as having had self-determination in mind. Mill’s work continues to have considerable influence on discussions on the normative significance of autonomy in relation to paternalism of various kinds.

A tremendous amount of research on autonomy has taken place in the last several decades in both the analytic and continental traditions. Continental philosophers speak more often of authenticity than of autonomy, but there are clear connections between the two, insofar as the ‘self’ in ‘self-determination’ is plausibly understood as the authentic self. Philosophers working in the analytic tradition have gone into great detail attempting to discern necessary and sufficient conditions for the presence of autonomy, as well as to uncover the ground and implications of its normative significance.

2. Conceptions of Autonomy

There are several different conceptions of autonomy, all of which are loosely based upon the core notions of self-government or self-determination, but which differ considerably in the details.

a. Moral Autonomy

As mentioned, moral autonomy is associated with the work of Kant, and is also referred to as ‘autonomy of the will’ or ‘Kantian autonomy.’ This form of autonomy consists in the capacity of the will of a rational being to be a law to itself, independently of the influence of any property of objects of volition. More specifically, an autonomous will is said to be free in both a negative and a positive sense. The will is negatively free in that it operates entirely independently of alien influences, including all contingent empirical determinations associated with appetite, desire-satisfaction, or happiness. The will is positively free in that it can act in accordance with its own law. Kant’s notion of autonomy of the will thus involves, as Andrews Reath has written, “not only a capacity for choice that is motivationally independent, but a lawgiving capacity that is independent of determination by external influence and is guided by its own internal principle–in other words, by a principle that is constitutive of lawgiving” (Reath 2006).  Now, because the lawgiving of the autonomous will contains no content given by contingent empirical influences, this lawgiving must be universal; and because these laws are the product of practical reason, they are necessary. Insofar, then, as Kant understood moral laws as universal and necessary practical laws, it can be seen why Kant posited an essential connection between the possession of autonomy and morality: the products of the autonomous will are universal and necessary practical laws–that is, moral laws. It is thus by virtue of our autonomy that we are capable of morality, and we are moral to the extent that we are autonomous. It is for this reason that Kant’s conception of autonomy is described as moral autonomy. Moral autonomy refers to the capacity of rational agents to impose upon themselves–to legislate for themselves–the moral law.

Furthermore, the capacity for autonomy, according to Kant, is “the basis of the dignity of human and of every rational nature;” and in accordance with this rational nature, is an end in itself. Furthermore, it “restricts freedom of action, and is an object of respect”. Many thinkers have followed Kant in grounding the dignity of persons (and respect for persons generally) in our capacity for autonomy (although it should be noted that not all of these thinkers have accepted Kant’s conception of autonomy). More will be said on this below.

Moral autonomy is said to be a bivalent property possessed by all rational beings by virtue of their rationality–although according to Kant, it is certainly possible not to live in accordance with its deliverances in practice (for more on Kant’s conception of autonomy, see Hill 1989, Guyer 2003, and Reath 2006).

One of the most common objections to this conception of autonomy is that such a robust form of independence from contingent empirical influences is not possible. Kant defended the possibility of such robust independence by arguing that human agents inhabit two realms at once: the phenomenal realm of experience, in relation to which we are determined; and a noumenal or transcendental realm of the intellect, in relation to which we are free. Given the further claim that our noumenal self can exercise efficient causality in the phenomenal realm, Kant held that our autonomy is in large part constituted by our noumenal freedom. The postulation of such a form of freedom may be criticized as metaphysically extravagant, however; and if such freedom is not possible, then neither is moral autonomy in Kant’s strict sense. Some thinkers have argued that Kant’s theorization on the noumenal realm was not meant to have metaphysical significance. Thomas Hill has argued, for example, that Kant may have been merely elaborating on the practical conditions in which we must understand ourselves insofar as we conceive ourselves as free. Objectors have insisted, however, that Kant intended to assert the more robust form of metaphysical freedom. Indeed, it could be pressed, he must have; for without this sense of freedom being operative, actual autonomy–and hence morality, by Kant’s lights–would not be possible.

b. Existentialist Autonomy

Existentialist autonomy is an extreme form of autonomy associated principally with the writings of Jean Paul Sartre. It refers to the complete freedom of subjects to determine their natures and guiding principles independently of any forms of social, anthropological or moral determination. To possess existentialist autonomy is thus to be able to choose one’s nature without constraint from any principles not of one’s own choosing. Sartre held this radical freedom to be entailed by the truth of atheism. According to Sartre, God’s nonexistence entails two key conclusions: firstly, humans cannot have a predetermined nature; and secondly, there cannot exist a realm of values possessing independent validity. Taken together, this entails that human beings are radically free: “For if indeed existence precedes essence, one will never be able to explain one’s action by reference to a given and specific human nature; in other words, there is no determinism–man is free, man is freedom. Nor, on the other hand, if God does not exist, are we provided with any values or commands that could legitimize our behavior. Thus we have neither behind us, nor before us in a luminous realm of values, any means of justification or excuse.”  Fettered neither by a predetermined nature nor by an independently existing order of values, “[m]an is nothing else but what he makes of himself” (Sartre 1946).

Like moral autonomy, existentialist autonomy is a bivalent property which all human persons are said to possess (although possibly without being aware of this). Unlike moral autonomy, however, existentialist autonomy has no necessary connections to morality or to rationality as traditionally conceived.

The primary objection to existentialist autonomy is that it is too radical to be plausible.  Even if God does not exist, it is argued, it does not follow that humans lack a nature that determines–at least to some extent–their choices, tendencies, proclivities, and guiding principles. A thoroughly naturalistic conception of human nature, informed by an understanding of the evolutionary forces operative in human psychology, seems to militate against the notion that humans are as unbounded as existentialist autonomy suggests we are. At the very least, it could be argued that empirical evidence does not speak in favor of the existence of existentialist autonomy in any robust form.

c. Personal Autonomy

Without question, the majority of contemporary work on autonomy has centered on analyses of the nature and normativity of personal autonomy. Personal autonomy (also referred to as ‘individual autonomy’) refers to a psychological property, the possession of which enables agents to reflect critically on their natures, preferences and ends, to locate their most authentic commitments, and to live consistently in accordance with these in the face of various forms of internal and external interference. Personally autonomous agents are said to possess heightened capacities for self-control, introspection, independence of judgment, and critical reflection; and to this extent personal autonomy is often put forth as an ideal of character or a virtue, the opposite of which is blind conformity, or not ‘being one’s own person.’

As mentioned above, personal autonomy has an essential relation to authenticity: the personally autonomous agent is the agent who is effective in determining her life in accordance with her authentic self. Personal autonomy is thus constituted, on the one hand, by a cluster of related capacities (often termed ‘authenticity conditions’), centered on identifying one’s authentic nature or preferences and, on the other hand, by a cluster of capacities (often termed ‘competency conditions’) that are centered on being able effectively to live in accordance with these throughout one’s life in the face of various recalcitrant foreign influences. These capacities may be possessed singly or in unison, and often require a considerable amount of life experience to assume robust forms.

One of the most intractable problems surrounding personal autonomy concerns the analysis of the authentic self (the ‘self’ in ‘self-determination’, as it were).  Some philosophers have claimed that no such self exists; and indeed, some philosophers claim that no self exists at all (for an overview of these problems, see Friedman 2003 and Mackenzie & Stoljar 2000).  Most philosophers accept the possibility of the authentic self at least as a working hypothesis, however, and concentrate attention on the question of how authenticity is secured by an agent. The most popular and influential account is based on the work of Harry Frankfurt and Gerald Dworkin. According to their ‘hierarchical’ account, agents validate the various commitments (beliefs, values, desires, and so forth) that constitute their selves as their own by a process of reflective endorsement. On this account, agents are said to possess first-order and second-order volitions. Our first-order volitions are what we want; and our second-order volitions are what we want to want. According to the hierarchical model, our first-order desires, commitments, and so on are authentic when they are validated by being in harmony with our second-order volitions: that is, when we want what we want to want. Following from this model, an agent is autonomous in relation to a given object when the agent is able to determine her first-order volitions (and corresponding behavior) by her second-order volitions. A simple example may help to illustrate the model. Say that I am a smoker. Although I enjoy lighting up, I do not reflectively endorse my smoking; I desire it, but I do not want to desire it. On the hierarchical model, smoking is not an aspect of my authentic self, because I do not reflectively endorse it; and to the extent that I am unable to change my habits, I am not autonomous in relation to smoking. Conversely, if I can bring my first-order volitions into harmony (or identity) with my second-order volition, then my desire is authentic because it is reflectively endorsed; and to the extent that I can mold my behavior in accordance with my reflective will, I am autonomous in relation to smoking.  Persons who possess the requisite capacities to form authentic desires and effectively to generally live in accordance with them are autonomous agents according to this model (see Frankfurt 1971, 1999 and Dworkin 1988).

The hierarchical model remains–in outline, at least–the leading account of authenticity undergirding most contemporary accounts of personal autonomy, although it has been attacked on many fronts. The primary objection tendered against this account is ‘the problem of origins.’ As we have seen, authentic selfhood as reflective endorsement holds that my authentic self is the self that I reflectively ratify: the self that I endorse as expressing, in a deep sense, who I fundamentally am or wish to be. The problem of origins arises when one attempts to explain how this act of reflective endorsement actually constitutes a break from other-determination (that is, from foreign influence). For, could it not be the case that what appears to me to be an independent act of reflective endorsement is itself conditioned by other-determining factors and therefore ultimately an other-determined act? If this is the case, then it doesn’t seem that the possession of autonomy or the making of autonomous choices is possible. In short, the problem is how to sustain an account of self-determination that is not threatened by the pervasive effects of other-determination (see Taylor 2005 for elaboration on the problem of origins and related sub-problems). Much work on theories of personal autonomy has been explicitly devoted to addressing precisely these sorts of difficulties.

Besides analyzing and clarifying the authenticity conditions necessary for autonomy, philosophers have also worked on providing a thorough account of the competency conditions necessary for the presence of autonomy (see Meyers 1989, Mele 1993, and Berofsky 1995). Competency conditions, as we have seen, are those capacities or conditions that need to be present in order for one to be effective in living according to one’s authentic self-conception in the face of various kinds of interference to that end.  Examples of competency conditions include self-control, logical aptitude, instrumental rationality, resolve, temperance, calmness, and a good memory.

In addition to authenticity and competency conditions, many theories of personal autonomy require the presence of certain external enabling conditions: that is, external or environmental (social, legal, familial, and so forth) conditions which are more than less out of the agent’s control, but which must be in place in order for fully autonomous living to be possible. Such enabling conditions include, for example, a modicum of social freedom, an array of substantive options for choice, the presence of authenticity-oriented social relations, and autonomy-supporting networks of social recognition and acknowledgment (see Raz 1986 and Anderson & Honneth 2005). Without these conditions, effective autonomous living is said by some to be impossible, even where authenticity and competency conditions are robustly satisfied. Different autonomy theorists place different emphases on external enabling conditions. Some contend that external enabling is a necessary condition for autonomy (see Oshana 1998). Others hold that autonomy more properly concerns agential satisfaction of authenticity and competency conditions, regardless of whether the external environment allows for actual autonomous expression (see Christman 2007). Both views can claim some intuitive support. On the one hand, it is reasonable to hold that it is only fitting to call a person ‘autonomous’ if that person is in fact effective in living according to her authentic self-conception. Yet, it also makes sense to call persons ‘autonomous’ who have formed an authentic self-conception and possess the requisite competency conditions effectively to express that self-conception, but happen to lack the contingent socio-relational conditions that allow for the expression of that authentic self. A possible solution to this impasse may be to avoid seeking hard and fast borders to the existence of autonomy, and say that autonomy is present in both cases, but is more robust where the proper external enabling conditions are in place.

The question of normative commitments associated with personal autonomy possession has also been a matter of some dispute. Many philosophers hold that autonomy is normatively content-neutral. According to this account, one (or one’s commitments) can be autonomous regardless of the values one endorses. On this account, one could commit to any kind of life–even the life of a slave–and still be autonomous (see, for example, Friedman 2003). Other philosophers hold that autonomy possession requires substantive normative constraints of some kind or other–at the very least, it is argued that one must value autonomy in order to be truly autonomous (see Oshana 2003). As with the debate just mentioned, both sides of this debate can claim some intuitive support; this can be shown through the asking of opposing but seemingly equally compelling (apparently rhetorical) questions; namely, ‘Can’t one autonomously choose whatever one wants?’, and, ‘How can we call someone autonomous who doesn’t value or seek autonomous living?’ One possible solution to this debate is to say that while almost any individual choice can be autonomous, persons cannot live autonomous lives as a whole without some commitment to the value of autonomy.

Unlike moral and existentialist autonomy, personal autonomy is possessed in degrees, depending on the presence and strength of the constellation of internal capacities and external enabling conditions that make it possible. While not all persons possess personal autonomy, it is commonly claimed that virtually everyone–with the exception of the irredeemably pathological and the handicapped–possesses the capacity for personal autonomy. In addition, the links between personal autonomy possession and moral agency are usually said to be thin at best. Even those who hold that personal autonomy possession requires substantive normative commitments of some kind (such as, for example, a commitment to the value of autonomy itself), they usually hold that it is quite possible to be an autonomous villain. Some philosophers have argued that personal autonomy possession requires the presence of normative competency conditions that effectively provide agents with the capacity to distinguish right from wrong (see Wolf 1990), but this strong account is in general disfavor, and even if the account is correct, few would argue that this means that personally autonomous agents must also always act morally. In the face of this, one may wonder why autonomy-based claims are said to generate demands of respect upon others. This question will be dealt with in more detail in section 4 below.

Lastly, a word should be given on the relation between personal autonomy and freedom (or liberty, which is here taken to be synonymous with freedom). Although it is not uncommon to find the terms ‘(personal) autonomy’ and ‘freedom’ used essentially synonymously, there are some important differences between them.

More often than not, to claim that a person is free is to claim that she is negatively free in the sense that she is not constrained by internal or external forces that hinder making a choice and executing it in action. There is a clear distinction between autonomy and negative freedom, however, given that autonomy refers to the presence of a capacity for effective authentic living, and negative freedom refers to a lack of constraints on action.  It is entirely possible for a person to be free in this negative sense but nonautonomous, or–on accounts that do not require the presence of external enabling conditions for autonomy to be present–for a person to be autonomous but not (negatively) free.

Some writers also speak of positive freedom, and here the connections with autonomy become much deeper. Speaking very generally, to be free in this sense is to possess the abilities, capacities, knowledge, entitlements or skills necessary for the achievement of a given end. For example, I am only (positively) free to win an Olympic gold medal in archery if I am extremely skilled in the sport. Here it should be clear that one can be positively free in many ways and yet not be autonomous. Some philosophers, however, following Isaiah Berlin (Berlin 1948), have described positive freedom in such a way that it becomes basically synonymous with personal autonomy. Like autonomy, the conception of freedom that is operative in a given discussion can vary considerably; but more often than not personal autonomy is distinguished from freedom by the necessary presence, in the former, of a connection to the authenticity of the agent’s self-conception and life-plan–a connection that is usually not found in conceptions of freedom.

d. Autonomy as a Right

Lastly, autonomy is sometimes spoken of in a manner that is more directly normative than descriptive. In political philosophy and bioethics especially, it is common to find references to persons as autonomous, where the autonomy referred to is understood principally as a right to self-determination. In these contexts, to say that a person is autonomous is largely to say that she has a right to determine her life without interference from social or political authorities or forms of paternalism. Importantly, this right to self-directed living is often said to be possessed by persons by virtue either of their potential for autonomous living or of their inherent dignity as persons, but not by virtue of the presence of a developed and active capacity for autonomy (see Hill 1989). Some have argued that political rights (Ingram 1994) and even human rights generally (Richards 1989) are fundamentally based upon respect for the entitlements that attend possessing the capacity for autonomy.

3. The Normative Roles of Autonomy

Although disagreements concerning the nature of autonomy are rife, almost no one disagrees that autonomy has normative significance of some kind; and this agreement is found both in relation to the claim that autonomy is normatively significant for the autonomous agent and to the claim that autonomy is normatively significant for the addressees of autonomy-based demands. Following from this, autonomy plays an important normative role in a variety of philosophical areas.

a. Autonomy in Ethical Theory

Autonomy is referenced or invoked in a number of key ways in ethical theory:

(i) Autonomy serves as a ground for the claims that persons have dignity and inherently deserve basic moral respect

(ii) Autonomy is said to have a value that grounds the claim that persons deserve to be told the truth

(iii) Autonomy is referenced as a fundamental principle of ethics in Kantian deontology

(iv) Autonomy is commonly viewed as a key component of human well-being (and is therefore significant for utilitarianism)

(v) Autonomy is defended as an important virtue

(vi) Autonomy is said to be necessary for moral responsibility

(vii) Autonomy is said to have a value that grounds the claim that autonomy-based demands are worthy of special respect

(i) Ever since Kant, autonomy (or the capacity for autonomy) has been referenced by some philosophers as that property of human beings by virtue of which they possess inherent dignity and therefore inherently deserve to be treated with basic moral respect.  Kant’s justification for the claim that autonomy grounds the inherent dignity of persons was based on the view that it is by virtue of our autonomy that we are ends-in-ourselves.  Beings that lack autonomy are, precisely because of this lack, essentially at the mercy of the determinism that characterizes the phenomenal realm: they are controlled by forces that have nothing to do with their own will. Beings that possess autonomy on the other hand, are, precisely because of this possession, free from this determination; they have the capacity for freedom through the active exercise of their autonomous wills, which allows for the legislation of universal law. Autonomous agents are not passive players in life; they are active agents, determining themselves by their own will, the authors of the laws that they follow (see Guyer 2003). As such, they are not passive means towards nature’s determined ends, but are ends-in-themselves, by virtue of which they possess inherent dignity and deserve basic moral respect. Many have followed Kant in referencing autonomy as the ground of human dignity and as the basis of the basic moral respect owed to persons, although not all have followed Kant in the details of his account (for a recent account that moves away from Kant’s conception of noumenal freedom, see Korsgaard 1996). The most common objection leveled against this account is that it runs into problems involving exclusion. Most would argue that the mentally handicapped, for example, are owed basic moral respect, even if they do not possess (even the capacity for) autonomy. And if human dignity is indexed to the presence of autonomy, it is argued, this would entail, counter-intuitively, that those who are more autonomous have more dignity, and are more worthy of respect. It may also be argued that the capacity for autonomy is a poor ground for human dignity (and respect for persons) for other reasons–for example, because autonomy has no essential connection to morality, or because better grounds are available, or because the very project of grounding human dignity on a property of some kind is ill-conceived. Despite these worries, however, appeals to autonomy as a basis for human dignity and basic moral respect remain quite popular.

(ii) Some philosophers have argued that a proper appreciation for others as autonomous (or as possessing the capacity for autonomy) requires that one not seek to deceive them.  Respect for autonomy is thus said to have an important relation to truthfulness. In Thomas Hill’s words, “Lies often reflect inadequate respect for the autonomy of the person who is deceived.” (Hill 1991) We saw above that autonomy’s value has been used to ground the basic moral respect owed to persons; and the present injunction against deception may be viewed as a specific form that autonomy-based respect for persons may take. It is easy to see why a connection between respect for autonomy and truthfulness (or what comes to the same thing–an injunction against deception) has been attractive to some philosophers, especially those in the Kantian tradition. When we deceive others for our own purposes, we bypass their reflective abilities and make them instruments in the achievement of our own ends, and in doing this we fail to treat them as persons capable and deserving of self-determination. Proper respect for persons as autonomous thus requires a commitment to truthfulness. It has been argued, however, that one may respect and value the autonomy of another while deceiving them at the same time (Buss 2005). One may, for example, use forms of deception so that another’s capacity for autonomy may flourish. The basic idea here is that one may still reason for oneself despite being deliberately influenced by the deceptive behavior of others. As Sarah Buss writes, “To put it somewhat crudely, whether an instance of practical reasoning is self-determined is a matter of whether it is really the agent herself who is doing the reasoning. And this would seem to depend on whether she determines her response to the considerations that figure in her reasoning–not on how the considerations to which she responds relate to reality, nor on how she came to be aware of these considerations.” It may be argued, however, that the conception of autonomy underlying this claim is too thin to be acceptable, and that a better conception would contain the resources necessary to judge self-determining reasoning influenced by the deliberate deception of another as nonautonomous. In this vein, some have argued that a person is autonomous in relation to a given desire or choice only if that person would not feel alienated from the causal process that gave rise to that desire or choice (Christman 2007). On the assumption that persons would feel alienated from deceptive desire- or choice-forming processes, the associated desires or choices would not count as autonomous. In response to this, however, it may be argued that autonomous agents may not feel alienated from all (or many) deceptive forms of influence upon the formation of their desires and choices, depending on the circumstances (Buss 2005). If this were the case, then a commitment to the value of autonomy may not be inconsistent with certain forms of deception or manipulation. Yet, given the traditional opposition between autonomous self-determination and agential determination rooted in deceit and manipulation, it is to be expected that resistance to the notion that they are not incompatible will continue.

(iii) Autonomy plays a key role in Kant’s deontological ethics. We have already seen this in the way in which Kant grounds human dignity in autonomy. But autonomy plays a further (and closely related) normative role for Kant. It is often said that Kant held that the Categorical Imperative can be expressed in three closely related formulas: the Formula of Universal Law, the Formula of Humanity, and the Formula of the Kingdom of Ends. It has also been claimed, however, that Kant defended a fourth formula, which may be called the Formula of Autonomy. Although Kant did not state this formula explicitly, it has been argued that it can be plausibly derived from his description of the Categorical Imperative as “the idea of the will of every rational being as a will that legislates universal law.” The corresponding Formula of Autonomy could then be expressed as an imperative in this way: act so that the maxims you will could be the legislation of universal law. According to this formula, we should act according to principles that express the autonomy of the will. This formulation is important, firstly because it suggests that Kant conceived autonomy as a normative principle (and not merely as a condition of the will that makes morality possible), and secondly because it further reinforces Kant’s claim that humans, as autonomous law-givers, are the source of the universal law that guarantees their freedom and hence marks them out as possessing inherent dignity (see Reath 2006).

(iv) Autonomy is commonly held to be a core component of well-being. This view goes back at least to Mill’s On Liberty, and has been accepted by many contemporary philosophers as well (see for example Griffin 1986 and Sumner 1996). In this connection, some argue that autonomy is an intrinsic part of well-being, and others argue that being autonomous reliably leads to well-being (and hence has instrumental prudential value).  Although thus far, the normative importance of autonomy has been described as being associated primarily with deontology, the claim that autonomy is a core component of well-being shows that it can play a key role in consequentialist moral theories as well. Indeed, as will be discussed in greater detail below (section 4), although most defenses of the principle of respect for autonomy are deontological in nature, it is also possible to defend the principle on consequentialist grounds. From this point of view, it can be argued that autonomy deserves respect because respecting autonomy is reliably conducive to well-being.

(v) Autonomy has been claimed to be an important virtue to possess. It is not difficult to see why this is the case. The autonomous person is a person possessing a constellation of widely desirable qualities such as self-control, self-knowledge, rationality and reflective maturity. To be autonomous is to be self-governing; to be free from domination by foreign influences over one’s character and values; to ‘be one’s own person’. Following from this, it is claimed by some that autonomy is a great virtue to possess - one which constitutes an important part of human flourishing. It may be objected, however, that an excessive concern with autonomy can be at odds with virtue, especially if robust autonomy entails an inability to exhibit loyalty or fidelity to projects, other persons or communities. Recent work on personal autonomy, however, has tended to support the notion that autonomy possession is not incompatible with these and similar forms of attachment (Friedman 2003).

(vi) Autonomy has been seen by some thinkers as having implications for a correct account of moral responsibility. Some accounts hold that autonomy is a necessary condition for moral responsibility. The basic defense of this claim is that it makes little sense to say that someone is morally responsible for her actions if she is not the author of those actions; and since one is the author of one’s actions only if one is autonomous, autonomy possession is necessary for moral responsibility. According to this account, the class of actions that are autonomous and the class of actions for which we are morally responsible are identical, or at least almost so (see Fischer and Ravizza 1998). Other accounts hold that although persons are certainly morally responsible for their autonomous actions, they are also morally responsible for a wider range of actions as well. An account of this sort is often made by those who hold a more demanding conception of autonomy; and defenders of this account argue that we still want to hold persons morally responsible for the many actions that do not satisfy robust autonomy conditions on the one hand, but are not constituted of sheer heteronomy (brainwashing, psychosis, coercion, and so forth) on the other (see Arpaly 2005).

(vi) Many thinkers believe that autonomous claims or demands are worthy of special normative uptake–special respect–by virtue of the fact that they are autonomous. It is important to see how this claim is different from the first point given above (viz., that autonomy is said to ground basic moral respect for persons). The former claim is that the fact that persons are autonomous (or have the capacity for autonomy) is what grounds their special dignity, by virtue of which they are owed basic moral respect. Now, it is possible to owe someone basic moral respect, but not to owe special respect to a subset of their choices. Imagine that someone is brainwashed, for example. Many would argue that although we owe that person basic moral respect (for example, we are obligated, say, not to harm them or to lie to them), we do not owe special respect to that person’s demands (say, to promote or not interfere with those demands). The current claim holds, however, that the fact that a person’s choices are autonomous generates special demands of respect for those choices over and above the basic respect owed to the chooser (whether this be conceived as being by virtue of their capacity for autonomy or not). This principle–that autonomous choice deserves special respect–may be justified in either a deontological or consequentialist manner. Because of the considerable importance of this principle, however, it deserves a more detailed discussion, which is provided in section 4 below.

b. Autonomy in Applied Ethics

The principle of respect for autonomy has had a considerable influence on applied ethics largely because of its versatility: it can be invoked in any applied ethics debate that bears (even remotely) on morally significant situations that involve the demands of self-determination, free choice, authenticity or independence. Seven of the most important of these debates–certainly not an exhaustive list–will be briefly canvassed below:

(i) Autonomy and informed consent

(ii) Autonomy and abortion

(iii) Autonomy and end-of-life decisions

(iv) Autonomy and same-sex marriage

(v) Autonomy and just war theory

(vi) Autonomy and advertising

(vii) Autonomy and environmental ethics

(i) Respect for autonomy has had a major influence on debates in medical ethics, especially those concerning the constraints that should be in place within the physician-patient relationship. Perhaps the most important such constraint is that of informed consent. According to this principle, a patient should not receive medical treatment of any sort unless she is well-informed enough as to the treatment’s nature and effects to be able to make an informed decision about it. The patient must agree to the treatment on the basis of this information. Many have argued that the requirement of informed consent is necessitated as part and parcel of a more basic imperative to respect patient autonomy (Dworkin 2006). Few argue that respecting patient autonomy has no weight at all; more commonly, objectors argue that there are cases in which overriding patient autonomy is sometimes justified by the good consequences that will likely result from doing so.

(ii) Autonomy is also referenced as an important value to be taken into consideration in the abortion debate, although it is referenced in different ways. On the one hand, it is argued that some abortions are justified as an expression of a woman’s reproductive autonomy (see Overall 1990 and Fischer 2003). On the other hand, it could be argued that abortion is morally unacceptable, among other reasons, because it fails to respect the potential future autonomy of the aborted (for a related argument, see Marquis 1989).  Assuming that both of these autonomy-based arguments have weight, adjudicating this dispute requires–among other things–establishing and defending the relative weights of actual and potential autonomy, both in relation to particular choices and in relation to lives as wholes.

(iii) Many argue that considerations of respect for autonomy are also decisive in the debates concerning the moral acceptability of euthanasia and suicide. Respect for autonomy can be viewed as a reason for accepting voluntary euthanasia. The basic argument here is one of consistency: if respect for others’ autonomy requires respecting others’ self-determining life-choices (at least when these are competently made), and if end-of-life decisions are placed within the ambit of life-choices, then end-of-life decisions made by competent, autonomous persons should be respected, even if these decisions involve voluntary euthanasia (for a related argument, see Brock 1993). Some have cast doubt, however, on whether a decision to die can be an autonomous decision at all, given the likely presence of psychological factors such as fear, hopelessness, and despair–factors which would undermine careful introspection and critical thought (Hartling 2006). Respect for autonomy can also be seen as a reason for respecting the decision to end one’s life, even when reasons of mercy are not in play–that is, in cases of suicide–at least where there is reason to hold that the agent is sufficiently competent and rational (Webber & Shulman 1987). Some argue, however, that autonomy-based defenses of voluntary euthanasia and suicide involve a contradiction insofar as they invoke the value of autonomy to justify an act that destroys autonomy (Safranak 1988 and Doerflinger 1989). If correct, these arguments do not show that voluntary euthanasia or suicide are unacceptable; they show rather that arguments to establish their acceptability cannot be based on respect for autonomy. It may be a cause of worry, however, that such arguments prove too much by rendering unacceptable autonomy-based respect for any decision that involves a subsequent lessening of free choice.

(iv) Autonomy also carries normative weight in a number of applied ethics debates relating to public policy. Respect for autonomy can be straightforwardly referenced, for example, as an argument in favor of the acceptability of same-sex marriage: respect for others’ autonomy entails respect for their autonomous decisions, and decisions regarding marriage–even same-sex marriage–fall within these parameters (when autonomous).  Objectors might argue, however, that homosexual marriage is immoral, and that the right to noninterference with autonomous choice does not exist where the object of the choice is immoral. Few would argue, for example, that there exists an obligation to respect someone’s autonomous decision to embezzle money, given that that act is immoral. The question then becomes whether same-sex marriage is morally acceptable.

(v) Respect for autonomy also plays a role in discussions of a just-war theory. Specifically, it has been referenced as the key principle determining the proper constraints and limitations that should be in place if we wish our prosecution of war to be just. It has been argued, for example–and in partial conjunction with what has been said above–that possession of autonomy (or the existence of a capacity for it) is the ground of human dignity, and hence the actions which appreciate that dignity must center on respect for autonomy. In relation to war, this suggests that while war may sometimes be morally permissible (in cases of self-defense, for example), wartime actions cannot involve violations of others’ autonomy, especially that of noncombatants (for an extended discussion, see Zupan 2004).

(vi) In business ethics, respect for autonomy has been identified as a key reason why persuasive advertising practices are morally unacceptable (Crisp 1987). The arguments given in support of this claim largely follow those mentioned above in relation to truthfulness–viz. that respect for others’ autonomy is incompatible with deception or manipulation–combined with the claim that persuasive advertising practices constitute deception or manipulation. In this vein it has also been argued that persuasive advertising undermines consumer autonomy by creating foreign desires and wants and by producing compulsive behavior in consumers. Some have argued, however, that persuasive advertising practices do not threaten consumers’ autonomy, at least not necessarily or intrinsically (Arrington 1982). From this point of view, although such deception may occur, this is the exception; usually it provides consumers with the information necessary for making informed decisions. It has also been argued that, even if persuasive advertising thwarts autonomy, it is still in consumers’ interests to be exposed to it, given that companies would likely only go to such trouble for products that will be market-winners, and hence that consumers would have desired and bought those products anyway, even after careful consideration (Nelson 1978). One obvious problem with this argument is that it assumes that heavy persuasive marketing is a sign of product quality, which is certainly debatable; but even if that premise is granted, it may still be argued that rhetorical device laden advertising, by attempting to bypass consumers’ critical thinking abilities, violates their autonomy.

(vii) Respect for autonomy has even been referenced in relation to issues in environmental ethics. Eric Katz has argued, for example, that nature as a whole constitutes an ‘autonomous subject’, which therefore deserves moral respect and should not be treated as a mere means to the satisfaction of human ends (Katz 1997). Critics of this view may wonder whether the notion of an autonomous subject operative here has been stretched to breaking point, or rendered hollow. If correct, this criticism does not, of course, entail that prohibitions against using nature as a mere means to human ends cannot be provided; it simply means that an acceptable defense cannot be based on autonomy-related considerations.

It should be clear from the breadth and diversity of the employment of the principle of respect for autonomy that it is both, extremely versatile and a mainstay of applied ethics debates. The brief sketches given above concern some of the more prominent autonomy-related discussions in applied ethics, but other debates in applied ethics–relating, for example, to injunctions against discrimination (Gardner 1992 and Doyle 2007) or against domestic abuse (Friedman 2003), to name a couple–have been approached and adjudicated in reference to the importance of respecting autonomy as well.

More often than not, however, those who reference the principle of respect for autonomy in applied ethics either take its normative force for granted, or only devote passing attention to the question of its justification. Yet, given that the principle is neither self-evident nor immune to challenge, it is very important that those who reference the principle be able to provide a robust justification of its normative weight. Because of its fundamentality, this issue will be considered separately and in more detail in section 4 below.

c. Autonomy in Political Philosophy

Autonomy is considered normatively significant for issues in political philosophy, primarily in relation to discussions of social justice and rights. It is particularly important for political liberalism (see, for example, Christman and Anderson 2005); and some have argued that autonomy is the core value of liberalism (see White 1991 and Dagger 2005).  Four of the most important issues in political philosophy that invoke the normative significance of autonomy include:

(i) The establishment and validation of just social and political principles

(ii) The legitimation of political power

(iii) The justification of political rights (both specific and general)

(iv) The acceptability of political paternalism

(i) A conception of the autonomous individual provides the perspective from which social and political principles are formulated, and validated as just, in several contractarian political theories. A classic example is provided in Rawls’ A Theory of Justice (1971).  According to Rawls, principles of social justice are best conceived and validated based on what would be acceptable to (representatives of) members of society gathering together in an ‘original position’ behind a ‘veil of ignorance’. Rawls argued that the conditions that constrain this process will ensure that those taking part in it are acting autonomously (that is, according to Rawls, as free and rational). Of key importance is the veil of ignorance because, by preventing any detailed knowledge of one’s condition or place in society, it “deprives the persons in the original position of the knowledge that would enable them to choose heteronomous principles”. Rawls concludes: “[W]e can say that by acting from these principles persons are acting autonomously: they are acting from principles that they would acknowledge under conditions that best express their nature as free and equal rational beings.” Given these key constraints in the contracting process, it  results, according to Rawls, in valid principles of social justice. Here it can be seen that autonomy has double (and mutually supporting) normative significance: it characterizes members of society in an idealized way in order to form the normatively privileged perspective from which to establish principles of social justice; and it provides the standard that validates those principles as just (viz., by being accepted by autonomous agents). One can see the influence of Kant’s conception of autonomy and its normative significance in this doctrine. Roughly put, Kant held that moral principles are those that would be accepted by persons within an idealized constraint–viz., insofar as they are autonomous. Similarly, Rawls argued that the principles of social justice are those that would be accepted by persons within an idealized constraint–viz., insofar as they are conceived as autonomous (free and rational) agents behind a veil of ignorance in the original position. Rawls explicitly acknowledged his indebtedness to Kant in this regard.

(ii) In relation, a cornerstone of political liberalism is the view that political power is legitimized by its free acceptance by a state’s subjects who are conceived (at least minimally) as autonomous persons. John Locke is recognized as one of the key progenitors of this view of the legitimation of political power. In Two Treatises on Government (1689), he wrote: “Men being, as has been said, by nature all free, equal, and independent, no one can be put out of his estate, and subjected to the political power of another, without his own consent, which is done by agreeing with other men to join and unite into a community for their comfortable, safe, and peaceable living one amongst another…” That which secures the legitimacy of government on such a view is precisely the agreement to do so amongst those who are not only naturally equal in standing, but also free and independent–that is, self-directing. The tradition of placing crucial normative weight on the autonomy of the contracting parties has continued to the present.  Referring to liberalism in political philosophy in general, John Christman has written (2005), “Liberal legitimacy…assumes that autonomous citizens can endorse the principles that shape the institutions of political power….In this way, political power is an outgrowth of autonomous personhood and choice.” As before, autonomy is fulfilling two (mutually supporting) roles: it is being used to delimit the normatively privileged perspective from which judgment is authoritative regarding political legitimacy, and it is informing (at least partly) the standard in relation to which that judgment (viz., the acceptance of a political power) is made.

(iii) Autonomy is referenced as a core ground in the justification of political rights in a broadly liberal political framework. It is argued, for example, that a theory of autonomy has to be presupposed to achieve agreement with a theory of rights that in principle is acceptable to all. It is also argued that autonomy is absolutely central in views of rights that enshrine the idea that people have the freedom equally to conceive and enjoy widely different forms of meaningful life. Attracta Ingram (Ingram 1994) provides a clear articulation of the view that autonomy deserves a central place in the defense of a scheme of political rights: “I think that the most compelling answer is that people’s most vital human interest is in living meaningful lives. This interest cannot be secured while they are at risk of slavery, social subordination, repression, persecution, and grinding poverty - conditions that history shows to be the lot of many in societies which do not recognize the value of individual freedom. So it is rational for people to want to develop the mental capacities and social environment necessary to living independent lives. Since what is at stake is the proper distribution of human freedom, we have here matters of justice and rights; the province of political morality.” (112-3) Autonomy is thus said by some to be a–or the–core unifying value in a conception of rights that is liberal (and hence pluralistic) in tenor (see also Richards 1989). In addition, the value of autonomy is referenced to justify particular rights such as the right to free speech (Brison 2000) or the right to privacy (Kupfer 1987).

(iv) Autonomy is referenced by many as the core value that militates against the acceptability of political (and informal) paternalism. According to a widely-accepted conception, an act is paternalistic if it involves direct interference with another’s actions and will for the purpose of advancing (what the interferer takes to be) that person’s own good. Paternalism bypasses the agent’s capacity to be self-directing and ignores the agent’s wishes regarding the way she would like to live her own life; and it is these factors that constitute a violation of the autonomy of the one suffering paternalistic influence. It is commonly held that possession of the capacity for autonomy gives the agent a right and an authority–at least in relation to minimally voluntary, self-regarding choices (all else being equal)–to be self-determining without interference (for a detailed account of paternalism and the defense of the claims of autonomy, see VanDeVeer 1986; see also Mill’s classic argument against paternalism in On Liberty). Supporters of paternalistic doctrines tend to argue that paternalism is justified based either on the highly beneficial consequences of such interference, or on the ground that a policy of paternalism could be hypothetically accepted by autonomous agents when the possible related consequences are severe enough (on the latter see Rawls 1999). It has also been argued that a certain degree of paternalism is unavoidable, but that such paternalism should be constrained by the goal of leading persons to welfare-promoting choices while not threatening freedom of choice (Sunstein and Thaler 2003).

It is worth mentioning in passing that J.S. Mill, who is often referenced as a champion of individual liberty and a firm critic of paternalistic policy, endorsed a strong version of paternalism, but only in relation to “those backward states of society in which the race itself may be considered as in its nonage.”  In relation to these, Mill (1971) claimed that “Despotism is a legitimate mode of government in dealing with barbarians, provided the end be their improvement and the means justified by actually effecting that end.”  Although these claims of Mill’s would find few supporters today, it is worth adding that the standard that Mill employed to ground the distinction between unjustified and justified paternalism was the presence of a kind of maturity of thought and judgment that is not greatly dissimilar to autonomy: “[A]s soon as mankind have attained the capacity of being guided to their own improvement by conviction or persuasion…compulsion, either in the direct form or in that of pains and penalties for noncompliance, is no longer admissible as a means to their own good, and justifiable only for the security of others.”

d. Autonomy in Philosophy of Education

Several philosophers have argued that autonomy development is the most important goal (or at least one of the most important goals) of a liberal education. Reasoning in support of this claim usually takes two forms. Firstly, some argue that autonomy should be the primary goal of liberal education because autonomy enhancement is the most important goal of the liberal state, and hence an education in such a state should be an education for autonomy (see White 1991, and compare with Raz 1986, ch. 14). Secondly, some argue that autonomy should be the goal of liberal education because it should be a key goal of any form of education, largely because an education for autonomy is crucial for human well-being across the board.

The latter position has been challenged by communitarians, however, who argue that there is no justification for the claim that autonomy is universally valuable, and who see autonomy as at best a parochial (Western) value (see MacIntyre 1981, White 1991, and Raz 1986). The communitarian argument has been challenged in various ways. It has been directly counter-argued, for example, that autonomy is universally intrinsic to well-being (see Norman 1994 and Ishtiyaque & Cuypers 2008). In addition, the epistemic benefits of autonomy development for forming rational judgments about one’s life have been cited as reason for allowing the state to mandate education for autonomy, even over the protests of more traditionally-minded parents (MacMullen 2007). Although communitarians continue to be suspicious of the claim that autonomy should be a goal of all education, it is widely agreed that education for autonomy is central to an education in a liberal society.

4. Warrant for the Principle of Respect for Autonomous Choice

As mentioned above (in section 3a), the idea that autonomy gives rise to demands of respect can take two forms. On the one hand, it is argued that the possession of autonomy or the capacity for it grounds human dignity and the basic moral respect for persons that attends that dignity. On the other hand, it is argued that the fact that a choice or demand is autonomous is reason to give special or added normative uptake to that choice or demand. For clarity, one might refer to the former as the principle of respect for autonomy and the latter as the principle of respect for autonomous choice. The principle of respect for autonomy has already been examined in connection with Kant’s moral philosophy, and it was shown that although this principle has been popular, it is also quite controversial, largely because of problems involving exclusion. The principle of respect for autonomous choice will be examined in the present section. As shown above, this principle plays a key role in a variety of normative debates, especially debates in applied ethics. As has been mentioned, however, the principle is often either invoked without supporting argument or is given thin justification at best. The principle is therefore worthy of further discussion, especially with regard to its normative warrant. What is the warrant for the claim that autonomous choices give rise to special demands of respect? Two views have emerged on this question. Unsurprisingly, these views can be delineated along deontological and consequentialist lines.

Firstly, many philosophers following Kant (often only roughly), contend that autonomous choices deserve special respect because persons, as capable of self-determination, are entitled, all else being equal, to be self-determining without interference. This may be termed the authority view of the justification for the principle of respect for autonomous choice. The authority view is most often allied to the view that respect for autonomy functions primarily as a side-constraint which forbids paternalistically-motivated interference in the self-regarding, minimally voluntary choices of others, even if such interference would be prudentially best for the choosing persons.

Secondly, some philosophers following Mill, contend that autonomous choices deserve special respect because a policy of such respect conduces to desirable prudential consequences, either for the choosing agent, or aggregately. On this view, autonomous choices are not to be respected merely because they are autonomous, or because those making them have a capacity for self-determination, but rather because doing so will lead to the most beneficial prudential results. This more consequentialist view of the normative warrant for the principle of respect for autonomous choice may be termed the benefit view.

Based on the literature, it is quite clear that the authority view is the dominant view in the field, and has been for some time. Many philosophers hold that persons have a right to have their self-determining choices respected even in cases where there is good reason to think that the fulfillment of their autonomous choices would lead to bad prudential results (see Wellman 2003 and Darwall 2006). Against this it may be argued that where the prudential results of respecting a person’s autonomous choice are disastrous enough, interference may be justified, thus opening the door to the salience of consequentialist considerations bearing upon the principle (see Young 1982 and Wellman 2003). It has also been argued that the relation between the fulfillment of at least minimally robust autonomous choice and the resulting expression of authentic selfhood (conceived as highly prudentially significant) suggests that the benefit view deserves to be given closer attention (Piper 2009). Given the great popularity and wide employment of the principle of respect for autonomous choice, it is safe to say that the question of its normative warrant deserves far greater attention than it has thus far received.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Anderson, Joel and Axel Honneth. “Autonomy, Vulnerability, Recognition, and Justice.”  In Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism: New Essays, eds. John Christman and Joel Anderson, 127-149. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Arpaly, Nomy. “Responsibility, Applied Ethics, and Complex Autonomy Theories.” In Personal Autonomy: New Essays in Personal Autonomy and Its Role in Contemporary Moral Philosophy, ed. James Stacey Taylor, 162-180. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Arrington, Robert L. “Advertising and Behavior Control.” Journal of Business Ethics 1, no. 1 (Feb. 1982): 3-12.
  • Berlin, Isaiah. Two Concepts of Liberty. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1958.
  • Berofsky, Bernard. Liberation from Self: A Theory of Personal Autonomy. Cambridge; Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Brison, Susan J. “Relational Autonomy and the Freedom of Expression.”  In Relational Autonomy: Feminist Perspectives on Autonomy, Agency, and the Social Self, eds. Catriona Mackenzie and Natalie Stoljar, 280-299. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Brock, D. “Voluntary Active Euthanasia.” The Hastings Center Report 22, no. 2 (1993): 10-22.
  • Buss, Sarah. “Valuing Autonomy and Respecting Persons: Manipulation, Seduction, and the Basis of Moral Constraints.” Ethics 115, no. 2 (Jan 2005): 195-235.
  • Christman, John and Joel Anderson, eds. Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism: New Essays. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Christman, John. “Autonomy, History, and the Subject of Justice.” Social Theory and Practice 33, no. 1 (January 2007): 1-26.
  • Christman, J. “Autonomy, Self-Knowledge, and Liberal Legitimacy.” In Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism: New Essays, eds. John Christman and Joel Anderson, 330-357. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Cooper, John. “Stoic Autonomy.” In Autonomy, eds. Ellen Frankel Paul, Fred Miller, and Jeffrey Paul: 1-29. Cambridge: University of Cambridge Press, 2003.
  • Crisp, Roger. “Persuasive Advertising, Autonomy, and the Creation of Desire.” Journal of Business Ethics 6, no. 5 (July 1987): 413-418.
  • Dagger, Richard. “Autonomy, Domination, and the Republican Challenge to Liberalism.”  In Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism: New Essays, eds. John Christman and Joel Anderson, 177-203. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Darwall, Stephen. “The Value of Autonomy and Autonomy of the Will.” Ethics 116, no. 2 (January 2006): 263-284.
  • Doerflinger, Richard. “Assisted Suicide: Pro-Choice or Anti-Life?” The Hastings Center Report 19, no. 1 (Jan-Feb 1989): 16-19.
  • Doyle, Oran. “Direct Discrimination, Indirect Discrimination, and Autonomy.” Oxford Journal of Legal Studies 27, no. 3 (2007): 537-553.
  • Dworkin, Gerald. The Theory and Practice of Autonomy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
  • Dworkin, Gerald. “Autonomy and Informed Consent.” In Ethical Health Care, eds. Patrician Illingworth and Wendy Parmet, 79-91. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Pearson Prentice-Hall, 2006.
  • Fischer, John Martin. “Abortion, Autonomy, and Control Over One’s Body.” Social Philosophy and Policy 20, no. 2 (2003): 286-306.
  • Fischer, John Martin and Mark Ravizza. Responsibility and Control: A Theory of Moral Responsibility. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Frankfurt, Harry. “Freedom of the Will and the Concept of a Person.” In The Importance of What We Care About by Harry Frankfurt, 11-25. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
  • Frankfurt, Harry. Necessity, Volition, and Love. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Friedman, Marilyn. Autonomy, Gender, Politics. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003.
  • Gardner, John. “Private Activities and Personal Autonomy: At the Margins of Anti-discrimination Law.” In Discrimination: The Limits of the Law, eds. Bob Hepple and Erika Szyszczak, 148-171. London: Mansell, 1992.
  • Griffin, James. Well-Being: Its Meaning, Measurement, and Moral Importance. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1986.
  • Guyer, Paul. “Kant on the Theory and Practice of Autonomy.” In Autonomy, eds. Ellen Frankel Paul, Fred Miller, and Jeffrey Paul: 70-98. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • Hartling, O.J.  “Euthanasia–the Illusion of Autonomy.” Medicine and Law 25, no. 1 (2006): 189-99.
  • Hill, Thomas. “The Kantian Conception of Autonomy.” In The Inner Citadel: Essays on Individual Autonomy, ed. John Christman, 91-105. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989.
  • Hill, Thomas. “Autonomy and Benevolent Lies.” In Autonomy and Self-Respect by Thomas Hill, 25-42. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • Ingram, Attracta. A Political Theory of Rights. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1994.
  • Ishtiyaque, Haji and Stefaan Cuypers. “Authenticity-Sensitive Preferentism and Educating for Well-Being and Autonomy.” Journal of Philosophy of Education 42, no. 1 (February 2008): 85-106.
  • Kant, Immanuel, trans. Mary Gregor. Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
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Author Information

Mark Piper
James Madison University
U. S. A.

Medieval Theories of Aesthetics

The term ‘aesthetics’ did not become prominent until the eighteenth century in Germany; however, this fact does not prevent principles of aesthetics from being present in the Middles Ages. Developments in the Middles Ages paved the way for the future development of aesthetics as a separate discipline. Building on notions from antiquity (most notably Plato and Aristotle) through Plotinus, the medieval thinkers extended previous concepts in new ways, making original contributions to the development of art and theories of beauty.

Certain topics, such as proportion, light, and symbolism, played important roles in medieval aesthetics, and they will be given prominence in this article. Proportion was particularly important for architecture, which is apparent in the cathedrals. Medieval thinkers were also interested in the concept of light: what it is and how it affects everything, especially color. Symbolism was based on the view that the creation revealed God; therefore, symbolic meaning could be communicated through artwork, in particular to those who are illiterate.

Three philosophers, St. Augustine, Pseudo-Dionysius and St. Thomas Aquinas, provided significant contributions to aesthetic theory during the Middle Ages. These three philosophers employed the two predominant approaches to philosophy in the Middle Ages. Augustine and Pseudo-Dionysius were mainly influenced by Plato and Neoplatonism, while Thomas was mostly influenced by Aristotle. Due to their impact on the history of philosophy (in particular, aesthetics), these philosophers will be given more detailed treatment.

Table of Contents

  1. Influences on the Medieval Philosophers
    1. Plato
    2. Aristotle
    3. Plotinus
  2. Topics in Aesthetics
    1. Proportion
    2. Light and Color
    3. Symbolism
  3. Individuals on Aesthetics
    1. St. Augustine
    2. Pseudo-Dionysius
    3. St. Thomas Aquinas
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Influences on the Medieval Philosophers

a. Plato

Plato’s philosophy enjoyed a noticeable presence during the medieval period, especially in the writings of Augustine and Pseudo-Dionysius. The doctrine of the Forms was particularly salient.  According to Plato, there is a perfect Form of Beauty in which beautiful things participate.  For thinkers such as Augustine and Pseudo-Dionysius, platonic forms (including the form of Beauty) are in fact ideas in the mind of God, and the world is but a shadow of the divine image.  On this view, all beautiful things participate not in some abstract universal, but in God’s beauty.  Given Plato’s obvious influence on subsequent theories of aesthetics, further consideration of his views would be helpful.

Plato’s most prominent contribution to aesthetics is his notion of mimesis (imitation). Mimesis derives from the idea that beautiful things are mere replicas of Beauty itself. So conceived, beautiful things participate in the Forms by means of imitation. Moreover, Plato thought that the artist could only imitate sensible objects (or actions) which are themselves imitations of some form. On his view, such imitation results from a lack of knowledge of the Forms, the true essences of which artistic representations are but deficient approximations. Therefore, such representation is “far removed from the truth” (Plato, Republic, 598b5).  Plato famously illustrates this point through the example of a bed (Plato, Republic, 597b ff.). There is a perfect Form of a bed, which exists as the nature of a bed. Then, a carpenter makes a bed. Lastly, a painter paints a picture of the bed that the carpenter constructed. The painter’s imitation is three times removed from the true nature (or Form) of the bed.

A further aspect of imitation that concerned Plato was its socially corrosive influence. The concern is raised most notably in connection to poetry and staged tragedies. For example, if the youth see evil men prosper in plays, then the youth will be more inclined to become evil. “For that reason, we must put a stop to such stories, lest they produce in the youth a strong inclination to do bad things” (Republic 391e). Plato’s concern with how art affects people is also a concern for the medieval philosophers. Mimetic arts were forbidden from Plato’s ideal city, even those that would attempt to imitate the virtues. Plato allowed only those works of art that would perform some didactic function. The Catholic Church, during the medieval period, also used art to perform a didactic function, especially to communicate the faith to the illiterate.

b. Aristotle

Although Plato’s influence, in most areas of philosophy, was initially stronger, Aristotle’s system of logic dominated medieval philosophy. Eventually, through the writings of Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas, the  balance of Aristotle’s philosophy achieved greater respect than it had in the eyes of Christian philosophers and theologians. Of particular interest is Aristotle’s metaphysics. The concept of form, especially in terms of formal causality, provided a ground for later theories of beauty, which connected the beauty of an object to its form. In other words, an object’s form is the cause of its beauty. The main difference between Aristotle’s notion of form and Plato’s notion of the Forms is that Aristotle thought the form of the object was constituted by the essential or species-defining properties inhering in the object.  Plato maintained that the Forms of each thing existed in a realm that transcended physical things.

Another concept relevant for medieval aesthetics is found in the Metaphysics (see III.3), where Aristotle presented the foundation for the medieval notion of transcendentals. He specifically highlighted the interchangeable relationship between being and one. Though Aristotle never called them transcendentals, he prompted this conception by claiming that the notions “being” and “one” are the same. “[Being and unity] are implied in one another as principle and cause are.” (Metaphysics, 1003b23). Transcendentals transcend traditional Aristotelian categories. They are interchangeable with each other, and they are inseparable in terms of their ontological status. Transcendentals (more in subsection 3.c St. Thomas Aquinas) were particularly important to such thinkers as Thomas Aquinas, Avicenna, and Averroes.

Aristotle’s Poetics also contains several ideas that were important for medieval aesthetics. First, consider Aristotle’s notion of imitation. He writes, “A tragedy, then, is the imitation of an action that is serious and also, having magnitude, complete in itself; in language with pleasurable accessories, each kind brought in separately in the parts of the work; in a dramatic, not in narrative form; with incidents arousing pity and fear, wherewith to accomplish its catharsis of such emotions” (Aristotle, Poetics, 1449b25). Aristotle’s notion of mimesis is similar to the view of Plato, since they both claim that art imitates nature. However, Aristotle does not think that nature imitates the realm of the Forms. While Plato thinks that imitations are deficient replicas of real essences, Aristotle believes that imitation is natural and can also be used to educate (Poetics 1448b7).

Second, consider the notion of catharsis, developed in connection to Aristotle’s definition of tragedy. Aristotle uses this word twice in the Poetics (1449b7; 1455b15); it seems that he believed a tragedy could cleanse negative emotions such as fear and pity.

Finally, Aristotle emphasized some characteristics that art requires in order to be good. “Beauty is a matter of size and order” (Aristotle, Poetics, 1450b37). Size is important because something too small or too large is beyond one’s capacity to perceive the whole, which specifically related to the length of plays. Order concerns the relationship of the parts with each other and with the whole, which was also very important to medieval philosophers and artisans.

c. Plotinus

The Neoplatonic philosopher Plotinus provided two main contributions to guide medieval thinking on aesthetics. First, Plotinus made it clear that beauty chiefly applies to the sense of sight and hearing (Plotinus I.6.1), which was maintained in the Middle Ages. This notion is not only a contribution to a theory of beauty, but it delineates two senses as having primacy over the others for the acquisition of knowledge. And beauty, for the medieval philosophers, was frequently connected with knowledge.

Second, Plotinus argued against the notion that proportion is the primary component of beauty. “Almost everyone declares that symmetry of parts towards each other and towards a whole, with, besides, a certain charm of color, constitutes the beauty recognized by the eye, that in visible things, as indeed in all else, universally, the beautiful thing is essentially symmetrical, patterned” (Plotinus I.6.1). Plotinus proceeds to argue that simple things could not be beautiful, if symmetry was the only component of beauty. In other words, only compound things could be beautiful in a proper sense, if beauty depended on symmetry. Moreover, only the whole object would be beautiful, not its parts. The problem, for Plotinus, is that if something is beautiful, it must be composed of beautiful parts. If the parts are not symmetrical in themselves, then they could not be beautiful. This fact leads to an absurd conclusion, according to Plotinus; namely, a beautiful object could be composed of ugly parts. Plotinus does not suggest that symmetry is irrelevant or unnecessary for beauty; his point is that symmetry cannot be the only standard by which to measure an object’s beauty.

2. Topics in Aesthetics

a. Proportion

Proportion was very important to the medieval artisans, especially for architecture and music. In architecture, the primacy of proportion is most clearly seen in the cathedrals. Some cathedrals, from an aerial viewpoint, were in the shape of a cross. This shape also created a balance when viewed from within the cathedral. Paintings  had to exhibit balance in their compositions and it was important for music to exhibit harmony, in order for it to be beautiful.

The Pythagoreans are credited as being the first to study the relationships between numbers and sounds. They discovered certain pitches and proportions to be more pleasing to people than others, and these discoveries were propagated in the middle ages. Boethius writes in De Musica, “Nothing is more proper to human nature than to abandon oneself to sweet modes and to be vexed by modes that are not” (quoted in Eco, 2004, 62). Harmony has its origin in God; and therefore, music designed to bring one closer to God must be harmonious. The psychological effect of various musical modes was an important part of the theories of music. For example, some rhythms were considered to lead people more easily into lustful sins, while other rhythms were deemed appropriate for the education of young people. The earliest example of the effects of music was the story of Pythagoras allegedly calming a drunk adolescent simply by making the youth listen to a certain melody (in Hypophrygian mode). Music could influence the soul of human beings; therefore, the type of music people could hear had to be the sort that would positively influence them.

“The proportions that govern the dimensions of Greek temples, the intervals between the columns or the relationships between the various parts of the façade, correspond to the same ratios that govern musical intervals” (Eco, 2004, 64). The same principles of harmony and proportion applied to all the arts, although there were differences in the way they were applied. The numerical ratios, however, were the same because mathematical values are immutable. For example, the Golden Section, considered to be the most aesthetically pleasing proportion, was often the basis of proportions in architecture and painting.  Even though they were concerned with form, it should be stressed that the medievals were not advocates of form over function. The purpose of the building or painting was the most important thing for an artisan to consider. The form was manipulated in such a way to fulfill the purpose of the work.

b. Light and Color

Medieval scientists, such as Robert Grosseteste, were interested in discovering the nature of light. Grosseteste’s treatise, On Light, blends Neoplatonist theories of emanation and aspects of Aristotle’s cosmology. The effects of light became more important to the medieval artisans, particularly in architecture, and they frequently associated light with their theories of color. Light and color affected the thoughts of medieval thinkers on certain characteristics of beauty, such as radiance and clarity.

One of the motivations for the medieval philosophers to pursue the notion of light developed from the belief that God is Light. Though Plotinus was not a Christian, the seeds of this idea that God is Light can be seen in his writings. “The simple beauty of a color is derived from a form that dominates the obscurity of matter and from the presence of an incorporeal light that is reason and idea” (Plotinus, I.6). The incorporeal light, for the Christians, is God’s light and gives splendor to the whole of creation. Light is what allows the beauty of objects, especially their color, to become illuminated, in order to display their beauty to the fullest. Pseudo-Dionysius follows up on these thoughts, “And what of the sun’s rays? Light comes from the Good, and light is an image of this archetypal Good. Thus the Good is also praised by the name ‘Light’, just as an archetype is revealed in its image” (Pseudo-Dionysius, 74). The light of the sun is a mere reflection and symbol of the divine light. The sun illuminates the universe, but the sun’s light is not used up. Light, for the medieval philosophers, is an important condition for there to be beauty.

Light illuminates the colors, which led the medieval thinkers to construct theories about color. Hugh of Saint Victor wrote, “With regard to the color of things there is no lengthy discussion, since sight itself demonstrates how much Beauty it adds to nature, when this last is adorned by many different colors” (quoted in Eco, 2004, 125). There is a sense in which color causes beauty, since everything has color. Hence, more radiant colors will cause the object to be more radiant and, therefore, more beautiful.

c. Symbolism

Symbolism was employed, first, as a tool to give meaning to artworks, and, second, it was used in a hermeneutical sense, to discover the deeper meaning of texts (especially the Bible). Medieval symbolism derives from a particular view of the world. Umberto Eco explains, “Firstly there was metaphysical symbolism, related to the philosophical habit of discerning the hand of God in the beauty of the world. Secondly there was universal allegory; that is, perceiving the world as a divine work of art, of such a kind that everything in it possesses moral, allegorical, and analogical meanings in addition to its literal meaning” (Eco, 1986, 56). The main idea is that the universe revealed God, its author or creator, through its beauty. As Pseudo-Dionysius wrote, “Any thinking person realizes that the appearances of beauty are signs of an invisible loveliness” (The Celestial Hierarchy, I.3). This belief was influenced by the Platonic notion that things on earth are shadows of things from the realm of Forms. Therefore, medieval artists wanted to construct their art in a symbolic manner, which would, likewise, help point to God.

Symbolism has connotations in the realm of hermeneutics, which is based on this notion that beauty in nature reflects God’s beauty. To put it differently, God revealed Himself to human beings through general revelation (nature) and special revelation (the Bible). For Aquinas, all knowledge about God begins in the material realm through the senses (ST I.88.3). People who did not have access to the Bible, because of cultural differences or illiteracy, could still receive God’s truth through nature, if they sought it. Therefore, medieval artists tried to create art for those who did not have literary access to the Bible by using symbols.

3. Individuals on Aesthetics

a. St. Augustine

Augustine set the stage for medieval Christian philosophers, drawing heavily from the Platonist and Neo-Platonist traditions. As a result, Platonic philosophy dominated the Christian medieval thought until Thomas Aquinas helped to popularize the writings of Aristotle. Augustine made a sharp distinction between the creation of God (ex nihilo) and the creation of artists (ex materia). Hence, God’s creation was not related to the notion of mimesis, which was perceived to be the goal of the arts. Even natural beauty, which was made by God, is like a shadow of God’s beauty, rather than fully actualized beauty. In a sense, God’s beauty emanates out to natural things through His act of creation. The framework for this idea had its source in Neoplatonic philosophers, particularly Plotinus. God created matter, which was initially formless, “without any beauty” (Augustine, Confessions, Bk. 12.3). The earth occupies the lowest form of beauty, and things become more beautiful as they possess more form, and less of the void. God is supremely beautiful, since only God possesses perfect form. Augustine, therefore, believes in a hierarchy of beautiful things, based on how much form they possess or lack.

Augustine developed ideas about rhythm that are pertinent to his aesthetic theory, especially the belief that rhythm originates with God. This idea of rhythm is expounded in Augustine’s De Musica. For Augustine, rhythm is immutable and eternal because its source is God. Augustine demonstrates this by pointing out that people can decide to begin pronounce a word in a differently, since pronunciation arises through convention. However, mathematical truths cannot be determined by convention; they have already been determined. They can only be discovered by human beings. Augustine then claims that rhythm is like math; it can only be discovered by people. Rhythm is already determined in God, and human beings cannot invent it. The way Augustine describes this process of discovery is reminiscent of, though not identical with, Plato’s theory of recollection. In other words, rhythm can be discovered through a questioner (or investigation), like Socrates’ questioning of the servant boy in the Meno.

Unity, equality, number, proportion, and order are the main elements in Augustine’s theory of beauty (Beardsley, 93ff.). Beardsley points out that Augustine does not systematically present these characteristics of beauty, but they can be found, often in relation to one another, throughout his writings. First, everything exists as a separate whole unit; therefore, each thing has unity. Simply put, something cannot have the potential to be beautiful, unless it exists. And if it has existence, it will also be a unified whole. Thus, unity is a necessary element of beauty. Further, the more unified something is the more beautiful it will be. Second, concerning equality (or likeness), Beardsley writes, “The existence of individual things as units, the possibility of repeating them and comparing groups of them with respect to equality or inequality, gives rise to proportion, measure, and number” (Beardsley, 94). Third, “Number, the base of rhythm, begins from unity” (De Musica, xvii. 56). Number, for Augustine, measures rhythm. Since rhythm is based on number, which Augustine believes is immutable, then it follows that rhythm is likewise immutable. Fourth, “in all the arts it is symmetry [or proportion] that gives pleasure, preserving unity and making the whole beautiful” (Of True Religion, xxx. 55). Fifth, Augustine asserts, “everything is beautiful that is in due order” (Of True Religion, xli. 77). Moreover, Augustine says, “Order is the distribution which allots things equal and unequal, each to its own place” (City of God, XIX, xiii). In other words, the degree to which things are in their proper place is the degree in which they are beautiful.

b. Pseudo-Dionysius

About the sixth century, the writings of the anonymous author Pseudo-Dionysius, emerged and influenced philosophers, most notably Thomas Aquinas. His main work that has relevance for aesthetics is The Divine Names, in which he refers to God as Beautiful. For Pseudo-Dionysius, “beautiful” refers to something that participates in beauty, while “beauty” refers to that ingredient that makes things beautiful. In the Cause (God), “beautiful” and “beauty” have no distinction because the Cause gathers everything back into Itself. The beautiful, which is God, is unchangeably beautiful; therefore, the beautiful cannot cease to be beautiful. This immutable beauty would have to truly exist, if the beautiful is the source of all beauty. Pseudo-Dionysius explains, “For beauty is the cause of harmony, of sympathy, of community. Beauty unites all things and is the source of all things” (Pseudo-Dionysius, 77). Further, he claims, “This – the One, the Good, the Beautiful – is in its uniqueness the Cause of the multitudes of the good and the beautiful” (Pseudo-Dionysius, 77).  Two main points can be taken from these statements. First, beauty is the cause of any beautiful thing that exists; and, second, the beautiful and the good are the same. Since beauty is the source of all things that exist, everything has a degree of beauty. Accordingly, everything has a desire and drive to move back toward the Beautiful and Good, that is, the source of the beauty of everything. This cyclical process is evident throughout Pseudo-Dionysius’ thought and illustrates Plotinus’ influence. It also prefigures Thomas’ belief that God is the source of all beauty, and the final end of human beings is the beatific vision, where people see God in His glory.

c. St. Thomas Aquinas

In terms of aesthetics, Thomas Aquinas focused his comments mostly on the notion of beauty. However, he did not say enough to have a detailed system; his views are extracted from what he did say. The discussion here will deal with his definition of beauty, the standards of beauty, and the question of whether beauty is a transcendental.

Thomas’ definition of beauty is as follows: beauty is that which gives pleasure when seen (ST I-II, 27. 1). This definition, at first glance, seems to suggest a subjective understanding of beauty for Thomas. The ambiguity comes from this word ‘seen,’ which has a different implication than it might seem in English. One might be tempted to equate seen with glance or notice; however, these possibilities are incomplete because they imply a passive account of seeing. The notion of ‘seen’ is more closely associated with the activity of contemplation. Jacques Maritain offers some helpful explanation,

Beauty is essentially the object of intelligence, for what knows in the full meaning of the word is the mind, which alone is open to the infinity of being. The natural site of beauty is the intelligible world: thence it descends. But it falls in a way within the grasp of the senses, since the senses in the case of man serve the mind and can themselves rejoice in knowing: ‘the beautiful relates only to sight and hearing of all senses, because these two are maxime cognoscitivi’(Maritain, 23).

Knowing beauty is not the result of a discursive process, nevertheless it is an activity of the mind. Knowledge in general, for Thomas, occurs when the form of an object, without its matter, exists in the mind of the knower (De Trinitate, q. 5, a. 2). For example, suppose someone is gazing at a flower. The same form, which is immaterial, of the flower in extra-mental reality is received by the senses and begins to exist in the mind of the knower. Then, the knower can contemplate the form of the object and discover its beauty. This process could transpire quickly. The knower (or beholder) receives data from the sensible world through the senses, but the senses do not recognize something as beautiful. The mind is responsible for recognizing the beauty of a given object. Consequently, knowledge has two aspects: passive and active. The passive aspect receives data from extra-mental reality; the active aspect gives the abstracted forms new existence in the mind of the knower. The details of this process are not relevant here; it is mainly important to see that the form of the object in reality begins to exist in the mind of the knower. Since beauty, for Thomas, is caused by the form of the object, then this process explains how the apprehension of beauty is the result of cognition.

More specifically, the senses of sight and hearing are those through which the beholder receives the form of the object. For Thomas, these senses are the most important ones for cognition; therefore, they are the ones employed in perceiving the beautiful. Thomas maintains the objectivity of beauty, in the sense that beauty resides in the object. In other words, beauty is not a concept in the mind of the beholder imposed onto a given object. If beauty is objective, then there must be some criteria by which we discover whether something is in fact beautiful.

The criteria of beauty are not precise formulae for discovering or labeling beautiful things with absolute certainty. These criteria are more like guideposts to help finite minds apprehend beauty. They do not have to all be present for an object to be considered beautiful, and the presence of one does not guarantee that the object is beautiful. For Thomas, beauty has four primary standards: actuality, proportion, radiance, and integrity (ST, I.39.8c). The original context of this list is centered on the relationship of the three persons of the trinity, specifically in reference to the Son. The Son has integrity insofar as he “has in Himself truly and perfectly the nature of the Father.” The Son has proportion “inasmuch as He is the express Image of the Father.” Lastly, the third property [radiance, brightness, or clarity] is found in the Son, as the Word, “which is the light and splendor of the intellect.” Since Thomas did not specifically expound on these properties in relationship to art, modern commentators and interpreters have tried to fill in this gap. Therefore, the exposition of the properties below comes largely from Armand Maurer, Umberto Eco, and Etienne Gilson.

Actuality. Actuality is not mentioned in Thomas’ list of the characteristics of beauty. However, for Thomas, everything has its ultimate source in actuality (or being); therefore, actuality (or being) is the basis of beauty. According to Maurer, actuality is used in three ways when referring to beauty: existence, form, and action (Maurer, 6ff.). Beauty is grounded in the actual existence of the object. For Thomas, everything that has being will also have a degree of beauty, regardless of how small that degree appears. In other words, an object must exist, in some sense, in order for it to be beautiful; otherwise, it would be nothing. Therefore, actuality is the ground of beauty. Maurer explains, “Whatever actuality a being has over and above its existence, it owes to its existence. For without existence there is no being; there is simply nothing. So the actuality of existence is the source and origin of the whole being, including its beauty” (Maurer, 7).

The second aspect of actuality is form. Form separates the existence of different things. For example, a dog and a tree both exist, but the dog exists as a dog and the tree exists as a tree. “As each thing has its own form, so it has its own distinctive beauty. In the words of St. Thomas, ‘Everything is beautiful in proportion to its own form’” (Maurer, 8). This interpretation of Thomas can be gleaned from his account of the relationship between goodness and form (ST I.5.5). To summarize this passage, everything is what it is because of its form; therefore, a thing has more goodness [and beauty] when it achieves a higher level of perfection in its form. A tree is beautiful to the degree in which it perfectly attains to the form of a tree and, likewise, a dog would be beautiful according to the form of a dog.

The third aspect of actuality is action. “Action completes the actuality of existence and form” (Maurer, 8). A clear illustration of the notion of action is a dancer. A dancer sitting and drinking coffee is still a dancer, in the sense that she possesses the skill required for dancing. Yet she is most completely a dancer when she performs the act of dancing. Strictly speaking, actuality is not a characteristic of beautiful things; more precisely, it is the necessary condition for grounding beauty in anything.

Proportion. Plotinus had already dismissed the notion of proportion (or symmetry or harmony) as the only qualification of beauty; however, the medieval philosophers still believed proportion had some importance for beauty. “We have only to think of the symmetry of the petals of an orchid, the balance of a mathematical equation, the mutual adaptation of the parts of a work of art, to realize how important the factor of harmony is in beauty” (Maurer, 10-11). The object may actually be symmetrical, but it is more important that it is well-balanced. The parts of the whole are in harmony with one another. Proportion is mentioned in this quote from Thomas’ Summa:

Proportion is twofold. In one sense it means a certain relation of one quantity to another, according as double, treble and equal are species of proportion. In another sense every relation of one thing to another is called proportion. And in this sense there can be a proportion of the creature to God, inasmuch as it is related to Him as the effect of its cause, and as potentiality to its act; and in this way the created intellect can be proportioned to know God (ST I.12.1).

Following Eco, proportion, according to this statement, could be reduced to relationships of quantity and relationships of quality (Eco, 1988, 82). Relationships of quantity are more mathematical, while those of quality are considered more ‘habitual’, which Eco explains as a relation of “mutual reference  or analogy, or some kind of agreement between them which subjects both to a common criterion or rule” (Eco, 1988, 82). This second relationship could be one of matter to form, cause to effect, and Creator to created (SCG II.16.8; II.80-81.7).

Radiance. “Radiance belongs to being considered precisely as beautiful: it is, in being, that which catches the eye, or the ear, or the mind, and makes us want to perceive it again” (Gilson, 2000, 35). Radiance is a bit more difficult to pinpoint than the other standards. Radiance signifies the luminosity that emanates from a beautiful object, which initially seizes the attention of the beholder. This trait is closely related to the medieval notions concerning light. For example, in terms of natural light, there is a sense in which the paintings in a gallery lose some of their beauty when the lights are turned off because they are no longer being perceived. However, Thomas also connects beautiful things with the divine light. “All form, through which things have being, is a certain participation in the divine clarity [or light]. And this is what [Dionysius] adds, that particulars are beautiful because of their own nature – that is, because of their form” (Thomas, Commentary on the Divine Names, IV.6). This quote provides another account of Thomas connecting all beauty to the beauty of God, as the cause of all beauty.

Wholeness. The last standard of beauty for Thomas is wholeness or integrity. “The first meaning of this term, for St. Thomas, is existential: it expresses the primal perfection of a thing, which is found in its existence (esse). In a second sense a thing is integral when it is perfect in its operation. Wholeness, in short, demands perfection in being and action” (Maurer, 29). If some particular thing was perfectly beautiful, then it would have to be completely actualized, lacking nothing essential to its nature. In other words, anything that is imperfect in some way is lacking some thing or ability necessary for its completion. Thomas speaks about wholeness [or integrity] in the context perfection: “The 'first' perfection is that according to which a thing is substantially perfect, and this perfection is the form of the whole; which form results from the whole having its parts complete” (ST I.73.1).

Whether or not beauty is a transcendental property of being will be the last topic in this entry. As a starting point, something is considered a transcendental if it “can be predicated of being as such and therefore of every being” (Koren, 48). The notion of transcendentals has its origins in Aristotle, specifically the Metaphysics. Aristotle claimed, as quoted earlier, that being and unity are implied in one another (Metaphysics, 1003b23). From this beginning, the medieval philosophers developed a broader notion of transcendentals; the three most mentioned transcendentals are one, true, and good. Aquinas' main presentation of the transcendentals is found in his Questiones Disputatae de Veritate, Question 1. In this text, Aquinas claims that being is the first thing conceived by the intellect because “every reality is essentially a being” (Disputed Questions on Truth, Q.1). Yet, Aquinas writes, “some predicates may be said to add to being inasmuch as they express a mode of being not expressed by the term being” (Disputed Questions on Truth, Q.1).

A predicate can add to being in two ways. First, the predicate may express a special mode of being. For example, in itself expresses a special mode of being, namely a substance, but it fails to be a transcendental because it does not apply to being as such. It applies only to individual beings. Second, a predicate may express a mode of being that is common to every being in general. This second mode can be understood in two ways: (1) absolutely – referring to a being as it relates to itself; (2) relatively – referring to a being as it relates to other beings.

A predicate can express being in reference to itself (or being-absolutely) either affirmatively or negatively. Affirmatively, Aquinas claims that the predicate thing is a transcendental, since each being is a unified whole. Negatively, Aquinas claims that the predicate one is a transcendental, since each being is undivided with reference to itself.

Moving to the predicates that express a relative mode of being, Aquinas claims that there are two ways. The first way refers to the idea that each being is separate from all other beings, so Aquinas refers to something (or otherness) as a transcendental property of being. The second way is based on the correspondence that one being has with another, which also has two facets. As a precondition, Aquinas writes, “This is possible only if there is something which is such that it agrees with every being. Such a being is the soul, which, as is said in The Soul, 'in some way is all things.' The soul, however, has both knowing and appetitive powers” (Disputed Questions on Truth, Q.1). In terms of the knowing power, true is a transcendental property because all knowing is an assimilation of the thing known by the knower. In terms of the appetitive power, good is a transcendental because the good is “that which all desire” (referring to Aristotle's Ethics).

To summarize, transcendentals are properties of being as such (that is, every being). Each transcendental is convertible with being. In other words, the transcendentals are present wherever being is present. However, just like being can be found in varying degrees, the transcendentals can also be found in degrees. For example, every being is not perfectly or completely good, but every being is good to a degree. So, Aquinas' list of transcendentals consists of the following: thing, one, something, true, and good. But is this list necessarily exhaustive? Could other things, such as beauty, be transcendentals?

Some interpreters of Aquinas' thought have claimed that beauty is not a transcendental; so, Aquinas left it off his list intentionally. Jan Aertsen, toward arguing that beauty is not a transcendental, attempts to clarify what it means for something to be a transcendental. He writes, “If the beautiful is a transcendental, then it must participate in the two features of transcendentals: because of their universal extension they are really identical, but they differ from one another conceptually” (Aertsen, 71). Aertsen concedes the first feature in reference to beauty; beauty is identical to the other transcendentals, particularly the good. However, he rejects the idea that beauty is conceptually different from the good, which, if correct, would prevent beauty from being counted among the transcendentals. Considering beauty as a kind of sub-category of the good is probably the main reason for rejecting it as a transcendental.

Contrary to Aertsen, Jacques Maritain (and others, like Etienne Gilson and Umberto Eco) maintains that beauty is a transcendental. The main problem with this view is that Aquinas did not include beauty in his list. Concerning this problem, an accepted explanation does not exist. Like Aertsen, Maritain claims that beauty is identical with the other transcendentals. But, contrary to Aertsen, Maritain asserts that Aquinas makes it clear that beauty and goodness are conceptually distinct. Specifically, Maritain refers to a passage in the Summa Theologia where Aquinas writes,

They [beauty and goodness] differ logically, for goodness properly relates to the appetite (goodness being what all things desire); and therefore it has the aspect of an end (the appetite being a kind of movement towards a thing). On the other hand, beauty relates to the cognitive faculty; for beautiful things are those which please when seen. Hence beauty consists in due proportion; for the senses delight in things duly proportioned, as in what is after their own kind-because even sense is a sort of reason, just as is every cognitive faculty. Now since knowledge is by assimilation, and similarity relates to form, beauty properly belongs to the nature of a formal cause (ST I.5.4).

Aquinas asserts in this passage that beauty and goodness differ logically. Maritain and others use this passage to show that Aquinas claimed that beauty and goodness were conceptually different, yet metaphysically identical. If Maritain, and others, are correct, then beauty could count as a transcendental property of being.

As this last section on transcendentals illustrates, while medieval philosophers did not develop a system of aesthetics they do provide an interesting entry point to the study of aesthetics . Ideas concerning the beautiful are spread throughout their writings,  gathered and developed by later philosophers.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Aristotle. The Complete Works of Aristotle. 2 Vols. Edited by Jonathan Barnes. Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Augustine. Of True Religion. Translated by J. H. S. Burleigh. Chicago:Henry Regnery Company, 1968.
  • Baird, Forrest E. and Walter Kaufmann. Medieval and Renaissance Philosophy. 5th ed. Upper Saddle River: Pearson Prentice Hall, 2008.
  • Hofstadter, Albert and Richard Kuhns, ed. Philosophies of Art and Beauty: Selected Readings in Aesthetics from Plato to Heidegger. The University of Chicago Press, 1964 (This book was primarily used for its selections from Augustine).
  • Plato. Complete Works. Edited by John M. Cooper. Indianapolis, Hackett Publishing Company, 1997.
  • Plotinus. The Enneads. Translated by Stephen MacKenna. Burdett: Larson Publications, 1992.
  • Pseudo-Dionysius. The Complete Works. Translated by Colm Luibheid. New York: Paulist Press, 1987.
  • Thomas Aquinas. Summa Theologiae (ST). Translated by Fathers of the English Dominican Province. Westminster: Christian Classics, 1981.
  • Thomas Aquinas. Summa Contra Gentiles (SCG). 5 Volumes. University of Notre Dame Press, 1975.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Aertsen, Jan A. “Beauty in the Middle Ages: A Forgotten Transcendental?” Medieval Philosophy and Theology. Vol. 1. (1991), 68-97.
  • Beardsley, Monroe. Aesthetics from Classical Greece to the Present: A Short History. Tuscaloosa: University of Alabama Press, 1966.
  • Coomaraswamy, Ananda K. Christian and Oriental Philosophy of Art. New York: Dover Publications, Inc., 1956.
  • Eco, Umberto. Art and Beauty in the Middle Ages. Translated by Hugh Bredin. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1986.
  • Eco, Umberto. The Aesthetics of Thomas Aquinas. Translated by Hugh Bredin. Harvard University Press, 1988.
  • Eco, Umberto. Ed. History of Beauty. Translated by Alastair McEwen. New York: Rizzoli, 2004.
  • Gilson, Etienne. The Arts of the Beautiful. Dalkey Archive Press, 2000.
  • Gilson, Etienne. Painting and Reality. New York: Pantheon Books, 1957.
  • Koren, Henry. An Introduction to the Science of Metaphysics. St. Louis: B. Herder Book Company, 1955.
  • Maritain, Jacques. Art and Scholasticism. Translated by J. F. Scanlan. New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1930.
  • Maurer, Armand. About Beauty: A Thomistic Interpretation. Houston: Center for Thomistic Studies, 1983.

Author Information

Michael Spicher
University of South Carolina
U. S. A.


In biology, the activity of cloning creates a copy of some biological entity such as a gene, a cell, or perhaps an entire organism. This article discusses the biological, historical, and moral aspects of cloning mammals. The main area of concentration is the moral dimensions of reproductive cloning, specifically the use of cloning in order to procreate.

The article summarizes the different types of cloning, such as recombinant DNA/molecular cloning, therapeutic cloning, and reproductive cloning. It explores some classic stereotypes of human clones, and it illustrates how many of these stereotypes can be traced back to media portrayals about human cloning. After a brief history of the development of cloning technology, the article considers arguments for and against reproductive cloning.

One of the most predominate themes underlying arguments for reproductive cloning is an appeal to procreative liberty. Because cloning may provide the only way for some individuals to have a child that is genetically their own, a ban on cloning interferes with their reproductive autonomy.

Arguments against cloning appeal to concerns about a clone’s lack of genetic uniqueness and what may be implied because of this. Human cloning is of special interest. There are concerns that cloned humans would lack individuality, that they would be treated in undignified ways by their creators, or that they would be damaged by society’s expectations that they should be more like those from whom they were cloned. Because they would essentially be facsimiles of the original person, there is concern that the clones might possess less moral worth. The predominate theme underlying arguments against human cloning is that the cloned child would undergo some sort of physical, social, mental, or emotional harm. Because of these and other concerns, the United Nations and many countries have banned human cloning. An important philosophical issue is whether such a response against human cloning is warranted.

Table of Contents

  1. Types of Cloning
    1. Recombinant DNA Technology / Molecular Cloning
    2. Therapeutic Cloning
    3. Reproductive Cloning
  2. Misconceptions About Cloning and Their Sources
  3. Cloning Mammals: A Brief History
  4. Arguments in Favor of Reproductive Cloning and Responses
    1. Reproductive Liberty: The Only Way to Have a Genetically Related Child
    2. Cloning and Savior Siblings
    3. Cloning In Order to “Replace” a Deceased Child
    4. The Resultant Loss of Therapeutic Cloning for Stem Cell Research and Treating Diseases
  5. Arguments Against Reproductive Cloning and Responses
    1. The Right to an Open Future
    2. The Right to a Unique Genetic Identity
    3. Cloning is Wrong because it is “Playing God” or because it is “Unnatural”
    4. The Dangers of Cloning
    5. Cloning Entails the Creation of Designer Children, or it Turns Children into Commodities
    6. Cloning and the Ambiguity of Familial Roles
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Types of Cloning

a. Recombinant DNA Technology / Molecular Cloning

DNA/Molecular cloning has been in use by molecular biologists since the early 1960s. When scientists wish to replicate a specific gene to facilitate more thorough study, molecular cloning is implemented in order to generate multiple copies of the DNA fragment of interest. In this process, the specific DNA fragment is transferred from one organism into a self-replicating genetic element, e.g., a bacterial plasmid (Allison, 2007).

Because this kind of cloning does not result in the genesis of a human organism, it has no reproductive intent or goals, and it does not result in the creation and destruction of embryos, there is little to no contention regarding its use.

b. Therapeutic Cloning




Embryonic stem cells are derived from human embryos at approximately five days post-fertilization, in the blastocyst stage of development. Because of their plasticity, embryonic stem cells can be manipulated to become any cell in the human body, e.g., neural cells, retinal cells, liver cells, pancreatic cells, or heart cells. Many scientists hope that, with proper research and application, embryonic stem cells can be used to treat a wide variety of afflictions, e.g., tissue toxicity resulting from cancer therapy (National Cancer Institute, 1999) Alzheimer’s disease (Gearhart, 1998), Parkinson’s disease (Freed et al, 1999; National Institute of Neurological Disorders and Strokes, 1999; Wager et al. 1999; Gearhart, 1998), diabetes (Voltarelli et al, 2007; Shapiro et al., 2000), heart disease (Lumelsky, 2001; Zulewski, 2001), and limb paralysis (Kay and Henderson, 2001).

One current obstacle for the successful use of embryonic stem cells for disease therapy concerns immunological rejection. If a patient were to receive stem cell therapy in order to treat some affliction, her body may reject the stem cells for the same reason human bodies have a tendency to reject donated organs: the body tends to not recognize, and therefore reject, foreign cells. One way to overcome stem cell rejection is by creating embryos through somatic cell nuclear transfer with the patient’s own DNA. In 2008, a California research team succeeded in creating embryos via SCNT and growing them to the blastocyst stage (French et al., 2008). In SCNT, an ovum is emptied of its own nucleus, its DNA, and the chromosomal DNA from another person (in the case, a patient’s) is inserted. The ovum is then artificially induced to begin dividing as if it had been naturally fertilized (usually via the use of an electrical current). Once the embryo is approximately five days old, the stem cells are removed, cultured, differentiated to the desired type of body cell, and inserted back into the patient (the genetic donor in this case). Since the embryo was a genetic duplicate of the patient, there would be no immunological rejection. One use of this technology, for example, is to help treat individuals in the aftermath of a heart attack. Using SCNT to create a genetically identical blastocyst, new healthy cells could be derived and inserted back into the genetic donor’s heart in order to replace the damaged cardiac cells (Strauer, 2009).

It may also be possible to use therapeutic cloning to repair defective genes by homologous recombination (Doetschman et al., 1987). Cellular models of diseases can be developed as well, along with the ability to test drug efficacy: “cloning a single skin cell from a patient with a disease could be used to produce inexhaustible amounts of cells and tissue with that disease. The tissue could be experimented upon to understand why disease occurs. It could be used to understand the genetic contribution to disease and to test vast arrays of new drugs which could not be tested in human people” (Savulescu, 2007, 1-2). Pluripotent stem cells can also be used to test drug toxicity which could also diminish the chances of drug-related birth defects (Boiani and Schöler, 2002, 124).

Therapeutic cloning is controversial because isolating the stem cells from the embryo destroys it. Many individuals regard the human embryo as a person with moral rights, and so they consider its destruction to be morally impermissible. Moreover, because the embryos are created with the explicit intention to destroy them, there are concerns that this treats the embryos in a purely instrumental manner (Annas et al.,, 1996). Although some ethicists are in favor of using surplus embryos from fertility treatments for research (since the embryos were slated for destruction in any case), they are simultaneously against creating embryos solely for research due to the concern that doing so treats the embryos purely as means (Outka, 2002; Peters, 2001). Indeed, it is precisely because of these ethical issues that some individuals object to the positive connotations of the term “therapeutic” and refer to this work, instead, as “research cloning.” The term “therapeutic cloning” is, however, more widely used.

c. Reproductive Cloning

SCNT can also be used for reproductive purposes. Unlike therapeutic cloning, the cloned embryo is transferred into a uterus of a female of the same species and would be, upon successful implantation, allowed to gestate as a naturally fertilized egg would. The cloned embryo would possess identical chromosomal DNA as its genetic predecessor, but, because of the use of a different ovum, its mitochondrial DNA (the genetic material inhabiting the cytoplasm of the enucleated ovum) would differ, and, consequently, it would not be 100% genetically identical (unlike monozygotic multiples who, because they are derived from the same ovum, share identical chromosomal and mitochondrial DNA). In addition to its slight genetic difference, the cloned embryo would likely be gestated in a different uterine environment, which can also have an effect in ways that may serve to distinguish it from its genetic predecessor. For example, a cloned entity’s phenotype (its appearance) may look very different than that of its genetic predecessor because the embryo can undergo epigenetic reprogramming, where nongenetic (i.e., environmental) causes influence genes to manifest themselves differently. The result is that the genes behave in ways that may lead to a difference in appearance.

In addition to somatic cell nuclear transfer, there is another, less controversial and less technologically complex, manner of reproductive cloning: artificial embryo twinning. Here, an embryo is created in a Petri dish via In Vitro Fertilization (IVF). The embryo is then induced to divide into genetic copies of itself, thereby artificially mimicking what happens when monozygotic multiples are formed (Illmensee et al., 2009). The embryos are then transferred into a womb and, upon successful implantation and gestation, are born as identical multiples. If implantation is unsuccessful, the process is repeated.

One argument in favor of artificial embryo twinning is that it provides an infertile couple, who may not have been able to produce many viable embryos through IVF, with more embryos that they can then implant for an increased chance at successful reproduction (Robertson, 1994). Because some of the embryos may be saved and implanted later, it is possible to create identical multiples who are not born at the same time. One advantage to doing this is that the later born twin could serve as a blood or bone marrow donor for her older sibling should the need arise; because they are genetically identical, the match would be guaranteed (the converse could also hold, that is, the older individual could serve as a donor for the clone should the latter ever need it. The existence of a cloned person, therefore, could be mutually beneficial, rather than asymmetrical). However, some concerns have been raised. For example, it has been argued that artificially dividing the embryo constitutes an immoral manipulation of it and that, as much as possible, a unique embryo should be allowed to develop without interference (McCormick, 1994). Concerns over individuality have also been raised; whereas naturally occurring twins are valued as individuals, one worry is that embryos created through artificial twinning, precisely because of the synthetic nature of their genesis, may not be as valued (McCormick, 1994).

2. Misconceptions About Cloning and Their Sources

The general public still seems to regard human reproductive cloning as something that can occur only in the realm of science fiction. The portrayal of cloning in movies, television, and even in journalism has spanned from comedic to dangerous. Human clones have often been depicted in movies as nothing but carbon copies of their genetic predecessor with no minds of their own (e.g., Multiplicity and Star Wars: Attack of the Clones), as products of scientific experiments that have gone horribly wrong, resulting in deformed quasi-humans (Alien Resurrection) or murderous children (Godsend), as persons created simply for spare parts for their respective genetic predecessor (The Island), or as deliberate recreations of famous persons from the past who are expected to act just like their respective predecessor (The Boys from Brazil). Even when depicting nonhuman cloning, films (such as Jurassic Park) tend to portray products of cloning as menacing, modern-day Frankensteinian monsters of sorts, which serve to teach humans a lesson about the dangers of “playing God.”

Many other media outlets, although usually shying away from the ominous representation of clones so prevalent in the movies, have usually portrayed clones as, essentially, facsimiles of their genetic predecessor. On the several occasions which Time Magazine has addressed the issue of cloning, the cover illustrates duplicate instances of the same picture. For example, the February 19, 2001 cover shows two mirror image infants staring at each other, the tagline suggesting that cloning may be used by grieving parents who wish to resurrect their dead child. Even a Discovery Channel program, meant to educate its viewers on the nature of cloning, initially portrays a clone as nothing more than a duplicate of the original person. Interestingly enough, however, a few minutes into the program, the narrator, speaking over a picture of two identical cows, says: “But even if a clone person is created, that doesn’t mean it would be an exact copy of the original.” Yet almost immediately afterwards, the same narrator calls a clone “You, version 2.0.”

As philosopher Patrick Hopkins has pointed out, media conceptions about what human cloning entails, and the type of offspring that will arise from cloning, employ the tacit premise that clones are nothing but copies. The predominate belief that fuels this conception is that genetic determinism is true, i.e., that a person’s genes are the sole determining factor of her behavior and physical appearance; essentially, that a person’s identity is solely determined by her genetic constitution. If a person were to believe that genetic determinism is true, then it follows that she believes that a cloned person would be psychologically identical with her genetic predecessor because they are (almost) genetically identical. Hopkins also points out that, like the narrator in the Discovery Channel program, many media outlets “engage in confusing, contradictory bits of double-talk (or double-show). The images and not-very-clever headlines all convey unsettling messages that clones will be exact copies, while inside the stories go to some effort to educate us that clones will not in fact be exact copies” (1998, 129-130).

3. Cloning Mammals: A Brief History

In 1894, Hans Driesch cloned a sea urchin through inducing twinning by shaking an embryonic sea urchin in a beaker full of sea water until the embryo cleaved into two distinct embryos. In 1902, Hans Spemann cloned a salamander embryo through inducing twinning as well, using a hair from his infant son as a noose to divide the embryo.  In 1928, Spemann successfully cloned a salamander using nuclear transfer. This involved enucleating a single-celled salamander embryo and inserting it with the nucleus of a differentiated salamander embryonic cell.  In 1951, Robert Briggs and Thomas Kling, using Spemann’s methods of embryonic nucleus transfer, successfully cloned frogs. In 1962, John Gurdon announced that he too had successfully cloned frogs but, unlike Briggs and Kling’s method, he did so by transferring differentiated intestinal nuclei from feeding tadpoles (Wilmut et al., 2000). Gurdon’s successful use of differentiated nuclei, rather than the embryonic nuclei used by Briggs and Kling, was particularly surprising to the scientific community. Because embryonic cells are undifferentiated, and therefore extremely malleable, it was not too surprising that transferred embryonic nuclei produced distinct embryos when inserted into an enucleated oocyte. However, inciting differentiated nuclei to behave as undifferentiated nuclei was thought to be impossible, since the conventional wisdom at the time was that once a cell was differentiated (e.g., once it became a cardiac cell, a liver cell, or a blood cell) it could never reverse into an undifferentiated state. It was for this reason that, for a long time, creating a cloned embryo from adult somatic cells was thought to be impossible – it would require taking long-time differentiated cells and getting them to behave like the totipotent cells (cells that are able to differentiate into any cell type, including the ability to form an entirely distinct organism) found in newly fertilized eggs.

In 1995, Dr. Ian Wilmut and Dr. Keith Campbell successfully cloned two mountain sheep, Megan and Morag, from embryonic sheep cells. One year later, in 1996, Wilmut and Campbell successfully cloned the first mammal to be born from an adult somatic cell, specifically an udder cell (a sheep’s mammary gland): Dolly the sheep (Wilmut et al., 1997). In other words, Wilmut and Campbell were able to take a fully differentiated adult cell and revert it back to an undifferentiated, totipotent, state. This was the first time the process had been accomplished for mammalian reproduction. Furthermore, they were able to create a viable pregnancy and produce from it a healthy lamb (however, there were 276 failed attempts before Dolly was created, which, as it will be discussed below, creates concerns over the safety and efficacy of the procedure). Dolly the sheep died in 2003 after having been euthanized due to her suffering from pulmonary adenomatosis, a disease fairly common in sheep that are kept indoors; indeed, many members of Dolly’s flock had succumbed to the same disease. Additionally, she suffered from arthritis. Before she died, she produced six healthy lambs through natural reproduction. Since Dolly, many more mammals have been cloned through the use of SCNT. Some examples are deer, ferrets (Li et al., 2006), mules (Lovgren, 2003), other sheep, goats, cows, mice, pigs, rabbits, a gaur, dogs, and cats. One possible use of reproductive cloning technology is to help save endangered species (Lanza et al., 2000). In 2005, two endangered gray wolves were cloned in Korea (Oh et al., 2008).

The successful cloning of household pets holds special significance in that, when discussing the circumstances that led to their cloning, we can begin to discuss the ethical issues that arise in human reproductive cloning. In 2001, the first feline created via somatic cell nuclear transfer was born. She was named CC, short for “Copy Cat,” and was born at the College of Veterinary Medicine at Texas A&M University. The research that led to her creation was funded by the California based company “Genetic Savings and Clone,” who, between 2004 and 2006, offered grieving pet owners a chance to clone their sick or deceased pets (they closed their doors in 2006 due to the unsustainability of their business). What is most striking about CC is not simply her mere existence, but also that CC does not look nor act like her feline progenitor, Rainbow. Whereas Rainbow, a calico, is stocky and has patches of tan, orange, and white throughout her body, CC barely resembles a calico at all. Not only is she lanky and thin, she has a grey coat over a white body and is lacking the patches of orange or tan typical to calicos. There are personality differences between Rainbow and CC as well; whereas Rainbow is described as a shy, reticent, and a more “hands-off” kind of cat, CC is described as more playful, inquisitive, and affectionate (Hays, 2003).

“Genetic Savings and Clone” was founded by Lou Hawthorne, who was seeking a means to clone his family’s beloved dog Missy. Although Missy died before she was successfully cloned, Hawthorne banked her DNA in the hopes of ultimately succeeding in this endeavor. In 2004, a Texas woman paid $50,000 to clone her deceased Maine Coone Nicky and, as a result, Little Nicky, the world’s first commercially cloned cat, was born.  This was followed, in 2005, by the birth of Snuppy, the world’s first cloned dog. In 2007, three clones from Missy’s DNA were created and returned to the Hawthorne family. All this has incited some pet owners to pay large sums of money to clone their beloved deceased pets. Alan and Kristine Wolf paid thousands of dollars to have their deceased cat, Spot, cloned from skin cells they had preserved. According to the Wolfs, preserving Spot’s skin cells, in their mind, was almost equivalent to having Spot himself preserved. In other words, the Wolfs (and the woman who cloned Nicky) were willing to spend an exorbitant amount of money to clone their pets not just in order to receive another pet, but to, rather, receive what was, in their eyes, the same pet that they had lost (Masterson, 2010).

This allows us to begin exploring the ethical issues in the reproductive cloning debate. Some questions that arise are: Why did these individuals regard the recreation of the same DNA to equate to the recreation of the same entity that had died? Will these expectations transfer over to human cloning, where people will regard cloned children as the same individuals as their genetic predecessors, and therefore treat them with this expectation in mind? Will cloning, thus, compromise a child’s identity? Are such concerns grave enough to permanently ban reproductive cloning altogether?

4. Arguments in Favor of Reproductive Cloning and Responses

a. Reproductive Liberty: The Only Way to Have a Genetically Related Child

The Argument.

Procreative liberty is a right well established in Western political culture (Dworkin, 1994). However, not everyone is physically capable of procreating through traditional modes of conception. Cloning may be the only way for an otherwise infertile couple to have a genetically related child. Therefore, providing cloning as an option contributes to a greater scope of procreative liberty (Häyry, 2003; Harris, 2004; Robertson, 1998). For example, a couple may be able to generate only a few embryos from IVF procedures; cloning via artificially induced twinning would increase the number of embryos to a quantity that is more likely to result in a live birth. In another case, the male partner in a relationship may be unable to produce viable sperm and, instead of seeking a sperm donor, the couple can choose to use SCNT in order to produce a genetic copy of the prospective father. Since the prospective mother would use her own ova, they would both contribute genetically to the child (albeit with a different proportion than a couple who conceived using gamete cells).  In yet another example, neither parent may have usable gametes, so they employ a donor ovum, clone one of the two parents, and gestate the fetus in the female’s uterus. Or, perhaps one of the prospective parents is predisposed to certain genetic disorders and, in order to completely avoid their offspring inheriting these disorders, they decide to clone the other prospective parent. A single woman may want to have a baby, and would rather clone herself instead of using donated sperm. Also, cloning may give homosexual couples the opportunity to have genetically related children (this is especially true for homosexual women where one partner provides the mitochondrial DNA and the other partner provides the chromosomal DNA). These are a few examples of how cloning may provide a genetically related child to a person otherwise unable to have one. Because cloning may be the only way some people can procreate, to deny cloning to these people would be a violation of procreative liberty (Robertson, 2006).

Response 1: Negative vs. positive right to procreate.

One response is to distinguish between a positive right to procreate and a negative right to procreate (Pearson, 2007), and argue that reproductive liberty can be fully respected in the latter sense, and only conditionally respected in the former sense. This conditional respect may support the permissibility of prohibiting human cloning for reproductive purposes.

A negative right to x means that no one has the prima facie right to interfere in your request to fulfill x.  If you possess a negative right to x, this entails only one obligation on the behalf of others: the obligation to not obstruct your obtainment of x. For example, if I have a negative right to life, what this entails is that others have an obligation to not kill me, since this obstructs or hinders my right. Another way to regard it is that a negative right only requires passive obligations (the obligation to not do something or to refrain from acting).

A positive right requires more from obligation-bearers; it requires that active steps be taken in order to provide the right-bearers with the means to fulfill that right. If I have a positive right to life, for instance, it is not just that others have an obligation to not kill me; they have a further obligation to provide me with any services that I would need to ensure my survival. That is, the obligation becomes an active one as well as a passive one: an obligation to not destroy my life and also to provide services that enable me to preserve my life.

Keeping this distinction in mind, it is possible to deny that the right to reproduce is a positive right in the first place. That is, while we ought not to prevent anyone from procreating, we are not required to provide them with any technology whatsoever in order to enable them to procreate if they cannot do so by their own means. Hence, limiting access to certain types of assisted reproductive technologies to an otherwise infertile couple would not necessarily infringe on their (negative) right to procreate (Courtwright and Doron, 2007). Some have argued the opposing side, however, and have maintained that respect for procreative liberty not only entails access to artificial reproductive technology, but also the right to employ gamete donors and surrogate mothers (Ethics Committee of the American Fertility Society, 1985).

Response 2: Procreative liberty is not categorical.

Another possible response is to stress that, even if there is a positive right to procreate, the right is a prima facie, rather than a categorical, one and it is not the case that any step taken to combat infertility is in itself ethical (McCormick, 1993).  Therefore, determining what types of services can be offered to infertile couples must be tempered with certain considerations, e.g., the safety of the offspring born as a result of these services must be taken into account. If a particular type of reproductive technology poses a health risk to the resulting children, this is grounds enough to prevent the use of that technology (Cohen, 1996). In other words, even granting that individuals have a positive right to procreate, it does not follow from this alone that they should be provided with any means necessary for successful procreation. They may not be entitled to the use of a certain technological advancement (e.g., SCNT) if that advancement is deemed to pose a danger to the resulting offspring. Robertson concedes this objection, but he responds that “if a ban on cloning is justified, then a ban on many other forms of assisted reproduction and genetic selection should be as well, yet few persons are prepared to go that far” (2006, 206).  That is, in order for advocates of this objection to be consistent, they should be equally willing to ban other forms of reproductive technology that may result in harm to potential offspring.

b. Cloning and Savior Siblings

The Argument.

The concept of a “savior sibling,” a child that is deliberately conceived so that she could provide a means (through the donation of bodily fluids, umbilical cord blood, a non-vital organ, or tissue) to save an older sibling from illness or death is not new. What is new is that cloning would ensure that the new child is an appropriate match for the existing ailing person, since they would be genetically identical. Permitting cloning, therefore, would allow for a more expedient means of creating a savior sibling, since the alternatives (using preimplantation genetic diagnosis to screen embryos to determine which are genetically compatible with the sibling, implanting into a womb only the ones that are a match and discarding the others, or creating an embryo through natural reproduction and terminating the pregnancy if it is not a genetic match) are more involved and more time consuming. Of course, the rights of the new child would have to be respected; tissue, organs, or bodily fluids should only be removed given her consent (although this would not apply to umbilical cord blood banking, since the infant lacks the capacity for giving consent) (Robertson, 2006).

Response: Violating Kant’s formula of humanity.

Such a prospect raises concerns that cloning would facilitate viewing the resulting children as objects of manufacture, rather than as individuals with value and dignity of their own. The prospect of creating a child, solely to meet the needs of another child and not for her own sake, reduces the created child to a mere means to achieve the ends of the parents and the sick child. While it is admirable that the parents wish to save their existing child, it is not ethically permissible to create another child solely as an instrument to save the life of her sibling (Quintavalle, 2001).

Another way of explaining it is that creating a child solely for the purposes of providing life-saving aid for another child violates Immanuel Kant’s second principle formulation of the categorical imperative. Kant proscribes treating persons as a mere means, rather than as ends in themselves, maintaining that persons should “act in such a way that [humanity is treated] always at the same time as an end and never simply as a means” (1981, 36). Creating a child for the sole purpose of saving another child violates the formula of humanity because the child is created specifically for this end.

It should be noted, however, that such an objection would apply to any method that is used to create a child for similar reasons, including any other type of reproductive technology or even natural procreation. It is the intention with which a child is created that is in question here, not the method that is used in order to create the child. Another response is that Kant’s dictum is misapplied. A child who is created as a “savior sibling” may still, also, be loved and respected as an individual in her own right, and therefore may not necessarily be treated solely as a means (Boyle and Savulescu, 2001).

c. Cloning In Order to “Replace” a Deceased Child

The Argument.

In his article “Even If It Worked, Cloning Won’t Bring Her Back”, ethicist Thomas Murray recounts a letter he heard read at a congressional hearing regarding human reproductive cloning. A chemist, who was presenting her views in support of reproductive cloning, read a letter by a father grieving the death of his infant son. Murray recounts as follows:

Eleven days ago, as I awaited my turn to testify at a congressional hearing on human reproductive cloning, one of five scientists on the witness list took the microphone. Brigitte Boisselier, a chemist working with couples who want to use cloning techniques to create babies, read aloud a letter from “a father (Dada).” The writer, who had unexpectedly become a parent in his late thirties, describes his despair over his 11-month-old son's death after heart surgery and 17 days of “misery and struggle.” The room was quiet as Boisselier read the man's words: “I decided then and there that I would never give up on my child. I would never stop until I could give his DNA - his genetic make-up - a chance” (2001).

Depriving grieving parents of this unique opportunity, the only opportunity “to get back the child that they lost,” would be morally wrong. Cloning would provide such an opportunity to grieving parents.

Response 1: Assuming genetic determinism.

Like many of the arguments against reproductive cloning listed below, this argument in favor of cloning, despite its emotional appeal, erroneously assumes that genetic determinism is true. The grieving father’s letter maintained that he would never “give up on my child”, and that the way he would achieve this is to “give his DNA – his genetic make-up – a chance.” In other words, the father equated his son as an individual person to his genetic make-up; because he could recreate his son’s genes, he could recreate his son as a person. The tacit implication here is that cloning is desirable because it somehow presents a way to cheat death. It is through cloning that his son could be, in some sense, resurrected.

Given that individuals have sought to clone their deceased pets, the idea that grieving parents would seek to clone a deceased child is not far-fetched. Thomas Murray continues his article by disclosing that he too is a grieving father, having suffered the death of his twenty-year-old daughter who was abducted from her college campus and shot. Yet cloning, Murray continues, “can neither change the fact of death nor deflect the pain of grief” (2001). Murray goes on to stress that, due to varying other influences outside of genetic duplication, a clone would not, in fact, be a mere copy of its genetic predecessor. One interesting point is that both detractors of cloning (e.g., Kass and Callahan, whose views are explored below) and supporters of cloning (like the researcher that read this letter at the congressional hearing) find convergence in committing the same fallacy. Both assume that cloning recreates identity, and they differ only as to the desirability of that consequence. Yet, given that we have evidence that the robust form of genetic determinism these arguments assume is false (Resnik and Vorhaus, 2006; Elliot, 1998), both detractors and supporters of cloning who rely on it produce faulty arguments.

Response 2: A child is not replaceable.

Given the evidence that genetic determinism is false, Murray further stresses that using cloning as a method of replacing a dead child “is unfair. No child should have to bear the oppressive expectation that he or she will live out the life denied to his or her idealized genetic avatar…. Cloning a child to be a reincarnation of someone else is a grotesque, fun-house mirror distortion of parental expectations” (2001). Dan Brock further supports the contention that cloning in order to replace a deceased child is misguided (Brock, 1997). Moreover, because parents have cloned this child with the expressed purpose of replacing a deceased child, the expectations that the new child will be just like the deceased one would be overwhelming and impede the child’s ability to develop her own individuality (Levick, 2004). It should be stressed, however, that this response targets a particular use of cloning (one based on faulty assumptions), not the actual cloning procedure.

d. The Resultant Loss of Therapeutic Cloning for Stem Cell Research and Treating Diseases

The Argument.

Although SCNT is used to create embryos for therapeutic cloning, there is no intent to implant them in order to create children. Rather, the intent is to use the cells of the embryo in order to further research that may ultimately lead to treatments or cures for certain afflictions. Therefore, a categorical ban on SCNT affects not just the prospect of reproductive cloning, but also the research that could be done with cloned embryos. At the very least, the argument concludes, SCNT should be allowed for research and therapeutic purposes (Devolder and Savulescu, 2006; American Medical Association, 2003; Maas, 2001). This was the position presented by Senator Arlen Specter in his proposed Senate Bill 2439, called the “Human Cloning Prohibition Act of 2002:  A Bill to Prohibit Human [Reproductive] Cloning While Preserving Important Areas of Medical Research, Including Stem Cell Research.”

Response 1: Therapeutic cloning leads to reproductive cloning.

The first response maintains that, because therapeutic cloning and reproductive cloning both implement SCNT, allowing the procedure to be perfected for therapeutic cloning makes it more likely that it will later be used for reproductive purposes (Rifkin, 2002; Kass, 1998)

Response 2: Embryo experimentation is unethical.

The second response applies not just to therapeutic cloning, but to any type of embryo experimentation. From the time that an ovum is fertilized and syngamy (the fusion of two gametes to form a new and distinct genetic code) has successfully taken place, there exists a subject, the embryo, which is a bearer of dignity, moral status, and moral rights. It is unethical to experiment on an embryo for the same reason it is unethical to experiment on any human being and since embryo experimentation often results in the destruction of the embryo, this equates to murdering the embryo (Deckers, 2007; Oduncu, 2003; Novak, 2001). Typically, those who offer the second response (e.g., the Catholic Church) regard the human embryo as a complete moral subject upon conception (Pope John Paul II, 1995; Pope Paul VI, 1968), and therefore any experiment that harms them or destroys them is morally tantamount to any experiment that would destroy a person.

5. Arguments Against Reproductive Cloning and Responses

a. The Right to an Open Future

The Argument.

According to some ethicists who oppose human cloning, a cloned child’s identity and individuality will be compromised given that she will be “saddled with a genotype that has already lived” (Kass, 1998, 56; see also Annas, 1998 and Kitcher, 1997). Because of the expectations that the cloned child will re-live the life of her genetic predecessor, the child would necessarily be deprived of her right to an open future. Because all children deserve to have a life and a future that is completely open to them in terms of its prospects (Feinberg, 1980), and because being the product of cloning would necessarily deprive the resulting child of these prospects, cloning is seriously immoral. In a sense, this objection maintains that a cloned child would either lack the free will to live her life according to her own desire and goals or that, at the very least, her free will would be severely restricted by her parents or the society that has certain expectations of her given her genetic lineage. The child would be destined to live in the shadows of her genetic predecessor (Holm, 1998).

Response 1: Faulting cloning for the misconceptions of others.

This argument is unsuccessful in illustrating that there is something intrinsically morally wrong with cloning. The subject of this objection is not cloning itself, but rather the erroneous attitude that parents will have in regard to their cloned child. The child’s very desire to be different from her predecessor illustrates that she is not destined to be like her predecessor. Once prospective parents, and society in general, come to understand that cloned children will possess just as much individuality as any other person, it is possible that these fears, and the attempts to control the child’s future, will largely abate (Wachbroit, 1997). Additionally, if the reason people treat cloned children unfavorably is due to their misconceptions about cloning, then the proper response is not to ban cloning at the expense of compromising procreative liberty, but rather work to rectify these prejudices and misconceptions (Burley and Harris, 1999).

Moreover, it is not just parents of cloned children that may be guilty of violating the child’s right to an open future;  many parents are, to varying degrees of severity, already guilty of violating such a right with their naturally created children, and often times those attempts are subject to failure (see Agar, 2004, 106 for such an example). If such parents are not deprived of their opportunity to have children out of concern that they will violate their child’s right to an open future, then we seem hard pressed to find a reason to deprive couples who would turn to cloning for reproductive purposes of a similar opportunity.

Response 2: Assuming genetic determinism (again).

At its core, however, this objection assumes the very controversial thesis that either a person’s genes play an almost fatalistic role in her life decisions, or that individuals in society will assume some robust version of genetic determinism to be true and will treat cloned children according to that assumption. As abovementioned, there is much evidence to suggest that genetic determinism is not true. In their article “Genetic Modification and Genetic Determinism,” David Resnik and Daniel Vorhaus state that, when it comes to genetic modification, “even if a desired trait is successfully expressed it may not actually restrict options for the child… the open future critique paints with a far broader brush, alleging that the act of modification per se impacts the child's right to an open future. And it is this claim that we reject...” (2006, 9). The same can be said about cloning (Pence, 1998 and 2008; Wachbroit, 1997). Even if a cloned child did display certain behavioral traits belonging to her genetic predecessor, it is unclear whether the similarity in traits entails that a child’s future would be closed off. Moreover, there is much evidence that, usually, the general public rejects genetic determinism (Hopkins, 1998).

There is evidence, however, that some would regard cloning as a method for resuscitating the dead (the grieving father in Murray’s article attests to this, as well as the individuals who are willing to pay thousands of dollars in order to clone a deceased pet). This supports Kass’ claim that many people may expect a cloned child to be like her genetic predecessor. However, this misconception may quickly be rectified simply by observing the unique personality of the cloned child, especially since her experiences and her nurture, removed by at least a generation, will be substantially different than that of her genetic predecessor (Dawkins, 1998; Pence, 1998).

b. The Right to a Unique Genetic Identity

The Argument.

Because cloning entails recreating an existing person’s genetic code (with the exception of the difference in mitochondrial DNA), some argue that cloning would, necessarily, entail a violation of the cloned child’s right to a distinctive genetic identity (European Parliament, 1998). According to this objection, our DNA is what endows each human being with uniqueness and dignity (Callahan, 1993). Because cloning recreates a pre-existing DNA sequence, the cloned child would be denied that uniqueness and, therefore, her dignity would be compromised. This objection appears to be an incarnation of the objection from the Right to an Open Future. Certainly the concerns are similar: that a cloned child would be deprived of her own individual identity because of her genetic origins. However, whereas in the objection from the Right to an Open Future, the cloned child is deprived of individuality based on the perception of others (and, as is developed above, this does not seem to really be an objection to the practice of cloning simpliciter), this objection indicates that there is something inherently individuality-compromising, and therefore dignity-compromising, in recreating an existing genetic code. If this objection is successful, if recreating a pre-existing genetic code is intrinsically morally objectionable, then it would seem to present an objection to the actual cloning process.

Response 1: Genetic duplication and identical multiples.

Callahan argues that there is something intrinsically identity-depriving, and therefore dignity-depriving, in duplicating a genetic code. However, there is much evidence to counter this claim. As abovementioned, CC the cat neither looks nor acts like Rainbow, her genetic predecessor. However, the strongest evidence against this claim is the existence of identical multiples, who are, in essence, clones of nature (Pence, 2004; Gould, 1997). No one claims that identical multiples’ right to a unique genetic identity was compromised simply in virtue of their creation, which calls into question whether such a right exists in the first place (Silver, 1998; Tooley, 1998; Rhodes, 1995). If Callahan’s concerns were accurate, identical multiples would fail to be individuals in their own right, and, consequently, be harmed because of this. However, there is no evidence that identical multiples feel this way, and there does not seem to be anything inherent about sharing a genetic code that compromises individuality (Elliot, 1998). The fact that identical multiples do not seem harmed or deprived of individuality merely by virtue of not possessing a unique genetic code is evidence that Callahan’s concern against cloning in this regard is misguided.

Response 2: Forgetting nurture.

Lastly, proponents of this objection ignore the very important role that nurture has in shaping a person’s identity. A cloned child would be gestated in a different uterine environment. She would be born into either the same family, but with a different dynamic, as her genetic predecessor, or be born into a different family altogether. She would also likely be raised in a much different society (e.g., a child born in 2010 would have vastly different social influences than a child born in the 1960s or 1970s). She would have different friends, attend different schools, play different games, watch different television shows, listen to different music. The generational and historical differences between a clone and her genetic predecessor would undoubtedly go a long way when it comes to shaping the personality of the former (Pence, 1998; Dawkins, 1998; Harris, 1997; Bor, 1997).

What forms or shapes each person’s individual identity is an intricate interaction of genetics and nurture (Ridley, 2003). While being genetically identical to a pre-existing person will most likely result in some similarities, it will certainly not be strong enough to deprive a cloned child of her individuality or dignity.  A cloned child’s future would remain open, and there is no evidence that she is denied something irreplaceably unique by not having a unique genetic code. Moreover, concerns that genetic duplication compromises dignity overemphasize the role that genetics has as the source of human dignity. Human dignity, some philosophers have argued, has its source in virtue of our being persons and autonomous rational beings. Since, presumably, a clone would still be a person and an autonomous rational being, a clone would certainly retain her human dignity (Glannon, 2005; Elliot, 1998).

c. Cloning is Wrong because it is “Playing God” or because it is “Unnatural”

The Argument.

Another common concern is that cloning is morally wrong because it oversteps the boundaries of humans’ role in scientific research and development. These boundaries are set by either God (and therefore cloning is wrong because it is “playing God”) or nature (and therefore cloning is wrong because it is “unnatural”). Any method of procreation that does not implement traditional modes of conception, i.e., not involving the union of sperm and ova, is guilty of one (or both) of these infractions (Goodman, 2008; Tierney, 2007).  Moreover, advocates of this objection caution against removing God from the process of creation altogether, which, it is argued, is what reproductive cloning achieves (Rikfin, 2000).

Response 1: Clarifying the meaning of “playing God.”

Advocates of the “playing God” objection have the onus to define exactly what “playing God” means. One possible definition of “playing God” is that anything that interferes with nature, or the natural progression of life, interferes with God’s plan for humanity, and is therefore morally wrong. But this is too vague; humans constantly interfere with nature in ways that are not morally criticized. Almost all instances of medical advancements in the past 100 years (e.g., vaccines against diseases, respirators, incubators for preterm infants, pacemakers, etc.) interfere with nature in the sense that they prevent otherwise harmful or fatal afflictions from taking their toll on a human body. Would the same advocates of this objection against cloning object to artificial insulin injections to treat diabetes? (Glannon, 2005). To be more extreme, almost everything humans engage in, from wearing clothing, to using phones and computers, to indoor plumbing, all, in some sense, interfere with some aspect of nature.

Perhaps the more charitable understanding is that “playing God” is morally wrong when it comes to cloning because it is a process that artificially creates life, outside of the practice of sexual intercourse (Meilaender, 1997). Adhering to this definition of “playing God”, however, would condemn any form of artificial reproductive technology, as well as cloning, e.g., IVF, artificial insemination, or intrauterine insemination. In addition, anything that thwarts the natural process of conception (i.e., birth control) may also be morally condemned.  In the “Instruction on Respect for Human Life in Its Origin and on the Dignity of Procreation,” the Catholic Church denounces all forms of reproductive technology on the grounds that reproductive creation is strictly God’s domain (Congregation for the Doctrine of the Faith, 1987). However, most people who denounce human cloning on the grounds that it “plays God” do not denounce other forms of artificial reproduction on similar grounds.

Response 2: Knowing God’s will.

Yet another response is that this objection purports to know what God’s will is in regards to technological advancements such as cloning. However, since key religious texts (e.g., The Bible, The Torah, or the Qu’ran) make no mention of such advancements, it is presumably impossible to determine what God would have to say about them. In other words, inferences about God’s will on such matters are tenuous because we have little basis from which to draw these purported moral inferences (Pence, 2008).

Response 3: Biologism Fallacy.

One response to the “unnatural” objection is similar to the first response to the “playing God” objection; most everything humans do, from medicine to modern forms of sanitation, are “unnatural”, and most are not considered morally objectionable as a consequence. A second response is that such an objection commits what philosopher Daniel Maguire calls the “Biologism Fallacy”: “the fallacious effort to wring a moral mandate out of raw biological facts” (1983, 148). In other words, “unnatural” is not synonymous with “immoral” (and conversely, “natural” is not synonymous with “moral”). While it is true that cloning (along with other types of reproductive technologies) is not the “natural” way of conceiving a child, this alone does not render cloning immoral.

d. The Dangers of Cloning

The Argument.

Many philosophers and ethicists who would otherwise support reproductive cloning concede that concern for the safety of children born via cloning is reason to caution against its use (Harris, 2004; Glannon, 2005).  The claim is that a cloned child would be in danger of suffering from severe genetic defects as a result of being a clone, or that cloning would result in a high number of severely defective embryos before one healthy human embryo is developed. Ian Wilmut, Dolly’s creator, has denounced human reproductive cloning as too dangerous to attempt (Travis, 2001). According to Wilmut, “Dolly was derived from 277 embryos, so the other 276 didn’t make it. The previous year’s work, which led to the birth and survival of Megan and Morag, used more than 200 embryos. We have success rates of roughly one in a hundred or less” (Klotzko, 1998, 134). Even if a clone were to appear healthy at birth, there are concerns about health problems arising later in life. For example, while there is no evidence that Dolly’s respiratory issues were due to her being a clone, questions remain whether her arthritis, which is uncommon among sheep her age, could have resulted because of the nature of her genesis (Williams, 2003). Even attempting to perfect human reproductive cloning would entail a trial and error approach that would lead to the destruction of many embryos, and may produce severely disabled children before a healthy one is born.

Response 1: The nonidentity problem.

One response typically given by philosophers when concerning the ethics of preconception decisions that may lead to the birth of a disabled child involves an appeal to Derek Parfit’s nonidentity problem (Parfit, 1984, though Parfit himself does not apply this to cloning). Applied to preconception choices, Parfit’s argument can be applied as follows. Suppose I desire to get pregnant, but am currently suffering from a physical ailment that would result in conceiving and birthing an infant with developmental impairments. Yet, if I were to wait two months, my ailment would pass and I would conceive a perfectly healthy baby. Most people would agree that I should wait those two months; and, indeed, if I do not wait, many people would say that I acted wrongly. The resulting child, moreover, would most likely be identified as the victim of my actions. This intuitive response, however, is surprisingly tricky to defend.  If harm is defined as making someone worse off than she otherwise would have been, it is difficult to maintain that I harmed the resulting child by my actions, even if she were impaired. For the child that would have been born two months later would not have been the same child that is born if I do not wait; the impaired child would never have existed had I waited those two months. Unless the child’s life is so bad that her nonexistence would be preferable, I did not make the child worse off by conceiving her and giving birth to her with those impairments, and thus I did not harm her. Because I did not harm her, I did not do anything morally wrong in this circumstance. The argument can best be standardized as follows:

1. I have only harmed an individual if I had made her worse off than she otherwise would have been had it not been for my actions.

2. Only if I have harmed someone can my action be deemed morally wrong.

3. A child born with mental, physical, or developmental impairments usually does not have a life that is so bad that it renders nonexistence preferable.

4. Therefore, a child born with mental, physical or developmental impairments is not made worse off by being brought into existence.

5. Therefore, deliberate conception, gestation, and birthing of a child with mental, physical, or developmental impairments does not, usually, harm the child (unless the impairments are so bad that they make the child’s life worse than not having existed at all).

6. Therefore, I have (usually) done nothing morally wrong by deliberately bringing into existence a child who suffers from mental, physical, or developmental impairments.

Using the nonidentity problem in the context of the reproductive cloning debate yields the following result: The alternative to being born a clone is not to be born at all. Unless the cloned child’s life is made so horrible by her disabilities that it would have been better that she not been born at all, she was not harmed by being brought into existence via cloning, even if she is born with genetic defects as a result. As long as the cloned child has a life that, despite her genetic defect, is still worth living, then it would still be permissible to use cloning to bring her into being (Lane, 2006).

It is important to note, however, that the nonidentity problem is controversial, and that not all philosophers and ethicists agree with its conclusion (Weinberg, 2008; Cohen, 1996). Indeed, many argue that it would be morally impermissible to bring a child into the world who suffers, even if the child’s life has a net value that renders it worth living (Steinbock and McClamrock, 1994).

Response 2: The dangers of natural reproduction.

Natural reproduction can itself produce dangerous results. Women dispose of fertilized eggs during their menstrual cycle more often than they are aware; one study claims that as many as 73% of fertilized eggs do not survive to 6 weeks gestation (Boklage, 1990). From the ones that do implant, approximately 2% to 3% of newborn infants suffer from congenital abnormities of varying degrees of severity (Kumar et al., 2004). If safety concerns about cloning are severe enough to ban its practice, this can only be justified if cloning were more risky (that is, resulted in the birth of more children with more severe abnormalities) than natural reproduction. Some couples choose to reproduce in full knowledge that one or both of them harbor genetic disorders that may be passed along to their offspring, and some of these are rather severe, such as Huntington’s disease. Yet these parents are not prohibited from procreating because of this. Therefore, if parents are not prohibited from procreating on the grounds that they may pass along a severe genetic defect to their children, then it is difficult to deny a set of parents who can only rely on cloning for procreation the chance to do so based on safety reasons alone (unless the abnormalities that may result from cloning are more severe than the abnormalities that may result from natural conception) (Brock, 1997). Similarly, objecting to cloning on the grounds that embryos are sacrificed in order to achieve a live birth is only a valid objection if the number of embryos lost are greater in cloning than in natural reproduction.

Finally, even if safety concerns are sufficient to warrant a current ban on human reproductive cloning, such concerns would be temporary, and would abate as cloning becomes safer. Indeed, safety concerns led the National Bioethics Advisory Commission (1997) to recommend a temporary, rather than permanent, moratorium on human reproductive cloning.

e. Cloning Entails the Creation of Designer Children, or it Turns Children into Commodities

The Argument.

If we engage in cloning, this objection goes, we run the risk of inserting our will too much into our procreative decisions; we would get to choose not just to have a child, but what kind of child to have. In doing so, we run the risk of relegating children to the status of mere possessions or commodities, rather than regarding them as beings with their own intrinsic worth (Harakas, 1998; Kass, 1998; Meilaender, 1997).  When a couple engages in sexual intercourse and produces a baby, the child is an “offspring of a man and woman, but a replication of neither; their offspring but not their product whose meaning and destiny they might determine” (Meilaender, 1997, 42). Because cloning involves the artificial process of recreating a pre-existing genetic code, prospective parents could, first, choose their child’s DNA (thereby creating a “designer child”), and, second, because they are creating a “replica” of an existing person, they will consider the child more akin to property than an individual in her own right. These factors will contribute to viewing and treating the child as a mere commodity. The more “artificial” conception becomes, the more the resulting children will be seen as the possessions of the parents, rather than as persons in their own right. Rev. Stanley Harakas puts this point as follows: “Cloning would deliberately deny by design the cloned human being a set of loving and caring parents. The cloned human being would not be the product of love, but of scientific procedures. Rather than being considered persons, the likelihood is that these cloned human beings would be considered ‘objects’ to be used” (1998, 89).

Although he rejects the contention that clones would not be considered persons, Thomas Shannon expresses concerns that the increasing artificiality of conception, not just via the use of cloning, but via the use of all forms of artificial reproductive technologies, will “transform our thinking about ourselves, and the transformation will be in a mechanistic direction” (Shannon and Walter, 2003, 134). That is, the move away from natural conception towards artificial conception will lead to humans collectively regarding themselves as more machine-like rather than as organic beings.

Response 1: Cloning is not genetic modification.

Cloning does not necessarily entail the creation of “designer” children because cloning recreates a pre-existing DNA; it does not involve modifying or enhancing DNA in order to produce a child with certain desired traits. Cloning is not to be equated with genetic modification or enhancement (Wachbroit, 1997; Strong, 1998).

Response 2: Natural vs. artificial conception.

Advocates of the objection that cloning results in the transformation of procreation into manufacture seem to assume that, whereas we do not consider children that arise from natural reproduction as ours to do what we wish with, we would if they arise from artificial conception. That is, the tacit premise is that there is some trait inherent in artificial (i.e., non-sexual) conception that necessitates parents regarding their children as mere objects, and this trait is not found in “natural” conception. Yet, we can look towards the children who are products of modern day artificial reproduction in order to see that such a concern is not supported by the evidence. There are many children who are products of artificial reproductive technologies (IVF, intrauterine insemination, gender selection, and gamete intrafallopian transfer, among others) and there does not seem to be an increase of despotic control over these children on behalf of their parents. One study found that children born from IVF and DI (donor insemination) are faring as well as children born via natural conception. More importantly, given Meilaender’s concern that the quality of parenting is compromised in tandem with the artificiality of conception, the study found that “the quality of parenting in families with a child conceived by assisted conception is superior to that shown by families with a naturally conceived child, even when gamete donation is used in the child's conception” (Golombok et al., 1995, 295; also see Golombok, 2003 and Golombok et al., 2001).

Meilaender may respond that, in these cases, the children are still a product of a unification of sperm and ovum, whereas this is not the case with cloning. However, it is unclear why generating a child via somatic cells is more likely to foster despotism than when the child is generated using germ cells. Some have argued that, on the contrary, a cloned child would feel even closer to the parent from whom she was cloned, given that they would share all their genetic information, rather than just half (Pence, 2008). Moreover, the findings of the study supported the thesis that “genetic ties are less important for family functioning than a strong desire for parenthood” (Golombok et al., 1995, 296), which suggests that the parents of cloned children would not be as caught up with the genetic origins of their offspring, and so their parenting would not be as affected by it, as Meilaender contends. According to the study, the quality of parenting increased in tandem with the amount of effort it took to achieve parenthood. It could be argued, therefore, that the quality of parenting for cloned children would be just as good, if not superior, to that of naturally conceived children.

Response 3: Clones would not be loveless creations.

Harakas claims that cloned children will be deprived of loving parents because their genesis will be one of science, rather than love. The studies conducted by Golombok certainly seem to provide evidence to the contrary. Intentionally taking steps to create a child via cloning (or any other kind of reproductive technology) could be seen, instead, as a mutual affirmation of love on behalf of the prospective parents and clear evidence that they really desired the resulting child. Whereas in sexual reproduction the child may be a product of chance, a cloned child would be a product of deliberate choice, which, according to some philosophers, could be a superior method of creation in some respects (Buchanan et al. 2000). Creating a child via cloning does not entail that there is a lack of mutual love between the parents, or that the resulting child would be any less loved (Strong, 1998). Genesis via sexual reproduction is neither a necessary nor a sufficient condition for being born to a set of loving parents and in a nurturing environment.

f. Cloning and the Ambiguity of Familial Roles

The Argument.

Genetically speaking, a cloned child would be her genetic predecessor’s identical twin sibling. If the child is cloned with the intent to serve as the social child of her genetic predecessor, she would be, genetically, her social mother’s twin sister (or his social father’s twin brother), and her social grandparents’ genetic daughter. The concern is that such a radical alteration of familial relationships would be detrimental to the cloned child (Kass, 1998; O’Neil, 2002). As Paul Ramsey puts it: “To mix the parental and the twin relation might well be psychologically disastrous for the young” (Ramsey, 1970). Wide-spread cloning would exacerbate the problem by distorting generational boundaries, which would add a layer of confusion to society’s conception of the nature of the family, and the roles of its individual members (Kass, 1998).

Response 1: No such confusion is likely to arise.

There are two responses to this response. First, doubts can be cast as to whether this confusion would really ensue. Second, even if such confusion did result, it is questionable whether it would be any more detrimental to the child than any confusion that currently exists about parental roles given certain reproductive technologies. For example, it is physically possible for a child to have as many as six distinct “parents”: three genetic parents (the mitochondrial DNA donor, the somatic cell donor used to re-nucleate an enucleated ovum, and the sperm donor), one gestational parent, and two (perhaps even more) social parents. If a cloned child would not experience any less confusion than a child in such a situation, then we would be hard pressed to show why the prospective parents of the former ought to be denied the opportunity to have a genetically related child based on these grounds alone (Harris, 2004). Moreover, doubts can be cast as to whether the ambiguity of genetic lineage caused by the cloning relationship will really result in the consequences Kass and O’Neil are fretting. A social father, for example, is not likely to suddenly rescind his responsibilities toward his daughter because the child is, genetically, his wife’s twin sister (Wachbroit, 1997). Finally, as is evident from children raised by adoptive parents, social parents usually retain the honorific role as the child’s “real” parents, even though there are no genetic ties between them and the adopted child. In other words, what defines a parent seems to have less to do with genetics and more to do with who performs the social role of mother and father (Purdy, 2005).

Response 2: Such confusion would not warrant a prohibition on cloning.

Even if there were such confusion, however, would it be so detrimental as to warrant banning reproductive cloning altogether? Moreover, even if there were a detriment, it is unclear whether that would be a result of society’s prejudice and fear of human cloning, or a result that inherently comes with being a clone. Finally, it would have to be clear that being the genetic twin to a social parent is so detrimental that it would warrant interfering with the prospective parents’ reproductive liberty. Indeed, for any purported harm that may come from cloning (whether physical, psychological, or emotional), it must be argued why those harms are sufficient for banning reproductive cloning if comparable harm would not be sufficient for banning any other kind of reproductive method, whether natural or artificial (Harris, 2004; Robertson, 2006).

6. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

Bertha Alvarez Manninen
Arizona State University at the West Campus
U. S. A.


Autonomy is an individual’s capacity for self-determination or self-governance. Beyond that, it is a much-contested concept that comes up in a number of different arenas. For example, there is the folk concept of autonomy, which usually operates as an inchoate desire for freedom in some area of one’s life, and which may or may not be connected with the agent’s idea of the moral good. This folk concept of autonomy blurs the distinctions that philosophers draw among personal autonomy, moral autonomy, and political autonomy. Moral autonomy, usually traced back to Kant, is the capacity to deliberate and to give oneself the moral law, rather than merely heeding the injunctions of others. Personal autonomy is the capacity to decide for oneself and pursue a course of action in one’s life, often regardless of any particular moral content. Political autonomy is the property of having one’s decisions respected, honored, and heeded within a political context.

Another distinction that can be made is between autonomy as a bare capacity to make decisions and of autonomy as an ideal. When autonomy functions as an ideal, agents who do not meet certain criteria in having reached a decision are deemed non-autonomous with respect to that decision. This can function both locally, in terms of particular actions, and globally, in terms of agents as a whole. For instance, children, agents with cognitive disabilities of a certain kind, or members of oppressed groups have been deemed non-autonomous because of their inability to fulfill certain criteria of autonomous agency, due to individual or social constraints.

There is debate over whether autonomy needs to be representative of a kind of “authentic” or “true” self. This debate is often connected to whether the autonomy theorist believes that an “authentic” or “true” self exists. In fact, conceptions of autonomy are often connected to conceptions of the nature of the self and its constitution. Theorists who hold a socially constituted view of the self will have a different idea of autonomy (sometimes even denying its existence altogether) than theorists who think that there can be some sort of core “true” self, or that selves as agents can be considered in abstraction from relational and social commitments and contexts.

Finally, autonomy has been criticized as being a bad ideal, for promoting a pernicious model of human individuality that overlooks the importance of social relationships and dependency. Responses to these criticisms have come in various forms, but for the most part philosophers of autonomy have striven to express the compatibility of the social aspects of human action within their conceptions of self-determination, arguing that there need not necessarily be an antagonism between social and relational ties, and our ability to decide our own course of action.

This article will focus primarily on autonomy at the level of the individual and the work being done on personal autonomy, but will also address the connection of autonomy to issues in bioethics and political theory.

Table of Contents

  1. The History of Autonomy
    1. Before Kant
    2. Kant
    3. The Development of Individualism in Autonomy
    4. Autonomy and Psychological Development
  2. Personal Autonomy
    1. Content-Neutral or Procedural Accounts
      1. Hierarchical Procedural Accounts
      2. Criticisms of Hierarchical Accounts
      3. Coherentist Accounts
    2. Substantive Accounts
  3. Feminist Philosophy of Autonomy
    1. Feminist Criticisms of Autonomy
    2. Relational Autonomy
  4. Autonomy in Social and Political Context
    1. Autonomy and Political Theory
    2. Autonomy and Bioethics
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The History of Autonomy

a. Before Kant

The roots of autonomy as self-determination can be found in ancient Greek philosophy, in the idea of self-mastery. For both Plato and Aristotle, the most essentially human part of the soul is the rational part, illustrated by Plato’s representation of this part as a human, rather than a lion or many-headed beast, in his description of the tripartite soul in the Republic. A just soul, for Plato, is one in which this rational human part governs over the two others. Aristotle identifies the rational part of the soul as most truly a person’s own in the Nicomachean Ethics (1166a17-19).

Plato and Aristotle also both associate the ideal for humanity with self-sufficiency and a lack of dependency on others. For Aristotle, self-sufficiency, or autarkeia, is an essential ingredient of happiness, and involves a lack of dependence upon external conditions for happiness. The best human will be one who is ruled by reason, and is not dependent upon others for his or her happiness.

This ideal continues through Stoic philosophy and can be seen in the early modern philosophy of Spinoza. The concept of autonomy itself continued to develop in the modern period with the decrease of religious authority and the increase of political liberty and emphasis on individual reason. Rousseau’s idea of moral liberty, as mastery over oneself, is connected with civil liberty and the ability to participate in legislation.

b. Kant

Kant further developed the idea of moral autonomy as having authority over one’s actions. Rather than letting the principles by which we make decisions be determined by our political leaders, pastors, or society, Kant called upon the will to determine its guiding principles for itself, thus connecting the idea of self-government to morality; instead of being obedient to an externally imposed law or religious precept, one should be obedient to one’s own self-imposed law.  The former he called heteronomy; the latter autonomy. In his “What is Enlightenment” essay, he described enlightenment as “the human being’s emergence from his self-incurred minority” and called on his readers to have the courage to use their own understanding “without direction from another” (Kant 1996, 17). This description is close to what we might acknowledge today as personal autonomy, but Kant’s account is firmly located within his moral philosophy.

In acting we are guided by maxims, which are the subjective principles by which we might personally choose to abide. If these maxims can be deemed universal, such that they would be assented to and willed by any rational being, and thus not rooted in any individual’s particular contingent experience, then they may gain the status of objective laws of morality. Each moral agent, then, is to be seen as a lawgiver in a community where others are also lawgivers in their own right, and hence are to be respected as ends in themselves; Kant calls this community the kingdom of ends.

While the will is supposed to be autonomous, for Kant, it is also not supposed to be arbitrary or particularistic in its determinations. He sees our inclinations and emotional responses as external to the process of the will’s self-legislation; consequently, letting them determine our actions is heteronomous rather than autonomous. Feelings, emotions, habits, and other non-intellectual factors are excluded from autonomous decision-making. Any circumstances that particularize us are also excluded from autonomous decision-making.

The reason for Kant’s exclusion of feelings, inclinations, and other particular aspects of our lives from the structure of autonomy is rooted in his metaphysical account of the human being, which radically separates the phenomenal human self from the noumenal human self. All empirical aspects of our selfhood — all aspects of our experience — are part of the phenomenal self, and subject to the deterministic laws of natural causality. Our freedom, on the other hand, cannot be perceived or understood; rather we must posit the freedom of the will as the basis for our ability to act morally.

Contemporary Kantians within moral theory do not adhere to Kant’s metaphysics, but seek to understand how something like Kant’s conception of autonomy can still stand today. Thomas Hill suggests, for example, that the separation of our free will from our empirical selfhood be taken less as a metaphysical idea but as a normative claim about what ought to count as reasons for acting (Hill 1989, 96-97)

There are significant differences between Kant’s conception of moral autonomy and the conceptions of personal autonomy developed within the last thirty years, which attempt to articulate how social and cultural influences can be compatible with autonomous decision-making. Further, the majority of contemporary theories of personal autonomy are content-neutral accounts of autonomy which are unconcerned with whether or not a person is acting according to moral laws; they focus more on determining whether or not a person is acting for his or her own reasons than on putting any restrictions on autonomous action.

c. The Development of Individualism in Autonomy

Between Kant’s description of moral autonomy and the recent scholarship on personal autonomy, however, there was a process of individualizing the idea of autonomy. The Romantics, reacting against the emphasis on the universality of reason put forth by the Enlightenment, of which Kant’s philosophy was a part, prized particularity and individuality. They highlighted the role of the passions and emotions over reason, and the importance of developing one's own unique self. John Stuart Mill also praised and defended the development and cultivation of individuality as worthwhile in itself, writing that “A person whose desires and impulses are his own – are the expression of his own nature, as it has been developed and modified by his own culture – is said to have a character. One whose desires and impulses are not his own has no character, no more than a steam engine has a character” (Mill 1956, 73).

The Romantic conception of individuality was then echoed within the conception of authenticity that runs through phenomenological and existential philosophy. Heidegger posits an inner call of conscience summoning us away from ‘das Man’: in order to be authentic, we need to heed this inner call and break away from inauthentically following the crowd. This conception of authenticity became intertwined with the idea of autonomy: both involve a call to think for oneself and contain a streak of individualism (see Hinchman 1996).

Unlike the universalism espoused by Kantian autonomy, however, authenticity, like the Romantic view, involves a call to be one’s own person, not merely to think for oneself. For Kant, thinking for oneself would, if undertaken properly, lead to universalizing one’s maxims; for both the Romantics and the Existentialists, as well as for Mill, there is no such expectation. This division is still present in the contrast between conceiving of autonomy as a key feature of moral motivation, and autonomy as self-expression and development of individual practical identity.

The emphasis on autonomy within this strain of philosophy was criticized by Emmanuel Lévinas, who sees autonomy as part of our selfish and close-minded desire to strive toward our own fulfillment and self-gratification rather than being open to the disruptive call of the other’s needs (Lévinas 1969). He argues for the value of heteronomy over autonomy. For Lévinas, in heteronomy, the transcendent face of the other calls the ego into question, and the self realizes its unchosen responsibility and obligation to the other. The self is hence not self-legislating, but is determined by the call of the other. This criticism of the basic structure of autonomy has been taken up within continental ethics, which attempts to determine how or whether a practical, normative ethics could be developed within this framework (see for example Critchley 2007).

d. Autonomy and Psychological Development

The connection between autonomy and the ideal of developing one’s own individual self was adopted within the humanistic psychologies of Abraham Maslow and Carl Rogers, who saw the goal of human development as “self-actualization” and “becoming a person,” respectively. For Maslow and Rogers, the most developed person is the most autonomous, and autonomy is explicitly associated with not being dependent on others.

More recently Lawrence Kohlberg developed an account of moral psychological development, in which more developed agents display a greater amount of moral autonomy and independence in their judgments. The highest level bears a great resemblance to the Kantian moral ideal, in its reference to adopting universal values and standards as one’s own.

Kohlberg’s work was criticized by Carol Gilligan, who argued that this pattern reflected male development, but not female. Instead of taking “steps toward autonomy and independence,” in which “separation itself becomes the model and the measure of growth,” “for women, identity has as much to do with intimacy as with separation” (Gilligan 1982, 98). The trajectory is thus less about individualization and independence than toward ultimately balancing and harmonizing an agent’s interests with those of others.

Gilligan does not entirely repudiate autonomy itself as a value, but she also does not suggest how it can be distinguished from the ideals of independence and separation from others. Her critiques have been widely influential and have played a major role in provoking work on feminist ethics and, despite her criticism of the ideal of autonomy, conceptions of “relational autonomy.”

The contemporary literature on personal autonomy within philosophy tends to avoid these psychological ideas of individual development and self-actualization. For the most part, it adopts a content-neutral approach that rejects any particular developmental criteria for autonomous action, and is more concerned with articulating the structure by which particular actions can be deemed autonomous (or, conversely, the structure by which an agent can be deemed autonomous with respect to particular actions).

2. Personal Autonomy

The contemporary discussion of personal autonomy can primarily be distinguished from Kantian moral autonomy through its commitment to metaphysical neutrality. Related to this is the adherence to at least a procedural individualism: within contemporary personal autonomy accounts, an action is not judged to be autonomous because of its rootedness in universal principles, but based on features of the action and decision-making process purely internal and particular to the individual agent.

The main distinction within personal autonomy is that between content-neutral accounts, which do not specify any particular values or principles that must be endorsed by the autonomous agent, and substantive accounts which specify some particular value or values that must be included within autonomous decision-making.

a. Content-Neutral or Procedural Accounts

Content-neutral accounts, also called procedural, are those which deem a particular action autonomous if it has been endorsed by a process of critical reflection. These represent the majority of accounts of personal autonomy. Procedural accounts determine criteria by which an agent’s actions can be said to be autonomous, that do not depend on any particular conception of what kinds of actions are autonomous or what kinds of agents are autonomous. They are neutral with respect to what an agent might conceive of as good or might be trying to achieve.

i. Hierarchical Procedural Accounts

The beginning of the contemporary discussion of personal autonomy is in the 1970s works of Harry Frankfurt and Gerald Dworkin. Their concern was to give an account of what kind of individual freedom ought to be protected, and how that moral freedom may be described in the context of contemporary conceptions of free will. Their insight was that our decisions are worth protecting if they are somehow rooted in our values and overall commitments and objectives, and that they are not worth protecting if they run counter to those values, commitments, and objectives. The concept of personal autonomy, thus, can be used as a way of protecting certain decisions from paternalistic interference. We may not necessarily want to honor the decision of a weak-willed person who decides to do something against their better judgment and against their conscious desire to do otherwise, whereas we do want to protect a person’s decision to pursue an action that accords with their self-consciously held values, even if it is not what we ourselves would have done. Frankfurt and Dworkin phrase this insight in terms of a hierarchy of desires.

Frankfurt’s and Dworkin’s hierarchical accounts of autonomy form the basis upon which the mainstream discussion builds and reacts against. Roughly speaking, according to this hierarchical model, an agent is autonomous with respect to an action on the condition that his or her first-order desire to commit the act is sanctioned by a second-order volition endorsing the first-order desire (see Frankfurt 1988, 12-25). This account is neutral with respect to what the origins of the higher-order desires may be, and thus does not exclude values and desires that are socially or relationally constituted. The cause of such desires does not matter, solely the agent’s identification with them (Frankfurt 1988, 53-54). Autonomy includes our ability to consider and ask whether we do, in fact, identify with our desires or whether we might wish to override them (Dworkin 1988).  The “we”, in this case, is constituted by our higher-order preferences; Dworkin speaks of them as the agent’s “true self” (Dworkin 1989, 59).

ii. Criticisms of Hierarchical Accounts

There are several different objections to the hierarchical model, mostly revolving around the problem in locating the source of an agent’s autonomy, and questioning the idea that autonomy can be located somehow in the process of reflective endorsement itself.

First, the Problem of Manipulation criticism points out that because Frankfurt’s account is ahistorical, it does not protect against the possibility that someone, such as a hypnotist, may have interfered with the agent’s second-order desires. We would hesitate to call such a hypnotized or mind-controlled agent autonomous with respect to his or her actions under these circumstances, but since the hierarchical model does not specify where or how the second order volitions ought to be generated, it cannot adequately distinguish between an autonomous agent and a mind-controlled one. The structure of autonomous agency therefore seems to have a historical dimension to it, since the history of how we developed or generated our volitions seems to matter (see Mele 2001, 144-173).

John Christman develops a historical model of autonomy in order to rectify this problem, such that the means and historical process by which an agent reaches certain decisions is used in determining his or her status as autonomous or not (Christman 1991). This way, an agent brainwashed into having desire X would be deemed nonautonomous with respect to X.  The theory runs into difficulty in a case where an agent might freely choose to give up his or her autonomy, or conversely where an agent might endorse a desire but not endorse the means by which he or she was forced into developing the desire (see Taylor 2005, 10-12), but at least it draws attention to some of the temporal features of autonomous agency.

Another criticism of the hierarchical model is the Regress or Incompleteness Problem. According to Frankfurt and Dworkin, an agent is autonomous with respect to his or her first order desires as long as they are endorsed by second-order desires. However, this raises the question of the source of the second-order volitions; if they themselves rely on third-order volitions, and so on, then there is the danger of an infinite regress in determining the source of the autonomous endorsement (see Watson 1975). If the second order desires are autonomous for some other reason than a higher-order volition, then the hierarchical model is incomplete in its explanation of autonomy. Frankfurt, while acknowledging that there is “no theoretical limit” to the series of higher order desires, holds that the series can end with an agent’s “decisive commitment” to one of the first order desires (Frankfurt 1988, 21). However, the choice of terminating the series is itself arbitrary if there no reason behind it (Watson 1975).

Frankfurt responds to this criticism in “Identification and Wholeheartedness” by defining a decisive commitment as one which the agent makes without reservation, and where the agent feels no reason to continue deliberating (Frankfurt 1988, 168-9). To stop at this point is, Frankfurt argues, hardly arbitrary. It is possible that the agent is mistaken in his or her judgment, but that is always a possibility in deliberation, and thus not an obstacle to Frankfurt’s theory in particular. In making a decision, an agent “also seeks thereby to overcome or to supersede a condition of inner division and to make himself into an integrated whole” (Frankfurt 1988, 174). Thus, by making this decision, the agent has endorsed an intention that establishes “a constraint by which other preferences and decisions are to be guided” (Frankfurt 1988, 175), and thus is self-determining and autonomous.

The criterion of wholeheartedness and unified agency has been criticized by Diana Meyers, who argues for a decentered, fivefold notion of the subject, which includes the unitary, decision-making self, but also acknowledges the functions of the self as divided, as relational, as social, as embodied, and as unconscious (Meyers 2005). The ideal of wholeheartedness has also been criticized on the grounds that it does not reflect the agency of agents from oppressed groups or from mixed traditions. Edwina Barvosa-Carter sees ambivalence as an inescapable feature of much decision-making, especially for mixed-race individuals who have inherited conflicting values, commitments, and traditions (Barvosa-Carter 2007). Marina Oshana makes a similar point, with reference to living within a racist society (Oshana 2005).

In any case, it is a puzzle how decisive commitments or higher-order desires acquire their authority without themselves being endorsed, since deriving authority from external manipulation would seem to undermine this authority. This is the Ab Initio Problem: If the source of an agent’s autonomy is ultimately something that can’t itself be reflectively endorsed, then the agent’s autonomy seems to originate with something with respect to which he or she is non-autonomous, something that falls outside the hierarchical model.

A related objection to the Regress Problem is that this hierarchical account seems to give an unjustified ontological priority to higher versions of the self (see Thalberg 1978). Marilyn Friedman has argued that it begs the question to assume some sort of uncaused “true self” at the top of the hierarchical pyramid. In order to give a procedural account that would avoid these objections, Friedman has proposed an integration model in which desires of different orders ought to be integrated together, rather than being constructed in a pyramid (Friedman 1986).

iii. Coherentist Accounts

Part of the appeal of understanding autonomy is not simply in explaining how we make decisions, but because the idea of autonomy suggests something about how we identify ourselves, what we identify with. For Frankfurt, we identify with a lower level desire if we have a second order volition endorsing it. However, our second order volitions don’t necessarily represent us — we may have no reason for them, which Frankfurt acknowledges.

This concern drives some of the other approaches to personal autonomy, such as Laura Ekstrom’s coherentist account (Ekstrom 1993). Since autonomy is self-governance, it stands to reason that in order to understand autonomous agency, we must clarify our notion of the self and hence what counts as the self’s own reasons for acting; she argues that this will help avoid the Regress Problem and the Ab Initio Problem.

Ekstrom’s account of self is based on the endorsement of preferences. An agent has a preference if he or she holds a certain first level desire to be good; it is similar to a second order volition for Frankfurt. It presupposes higher level states since they are the result of an agent’s higher order reflection about the agent’s desires with regard to goodness. A self, then, is a particular character with certain beliefs and preferences which have been endorsed in a process of self-reflection, and the ability to reshape those beliefs and preferences in light of self-evaluation. The true self includes those beliefs and preferences which cohere together; that coherence itself gives them authorization. A preference is thus endorsed if it coheres with the agent’s character.

Michael Bratman develops a similar account, arguing that our personal identity is partly constituted by the organizing and coordinating function of our long-range plans and intentions (Bratman 2007, 5). Our decisions are autonomous or self-governing with respect to these plans.

This is, of course, only a very brief account of some of the literature on proceduralist accounts of autonomy, and it omits the various defenses of the hierarchical model and the objections to Friedman’s, Christman’s, and others’ formulations. But it should be enough to make clear the way in which theorists offering these accounts strive to ensure that no particular view of what constitutes a flourishing human life is imported into their accounts of autonomy. Autonomy is just one valued human property amongst others, and need not do all the work of describing human flourishing (Friedman 2003).

b. Substantive Accounts

Some doubt, however, that proceduralist accounts are adequate to capture autonomous motivation and action, or to rule out actions that or agents who we would hesitate to call autonomous. Substantive accounts of autonomy, of which there are both weak and strong varieties, set more requirements for autonomous actions to count as autonomous. Whether weak or strong, all substantive accounts posit some particular constraints on what can be considered autonomous; one example might be an account of autonomy that specifies that we might not autonomously be able to choose to be enslaved. Susan Wolf offers a strong substantive account, in which agents must have “normative competency,” in other words, the capacity to identify right and wrong (Wolf 1990). We do not need to be metaphysically responsible for ourselves or absolutely self-originating, but as agents we are morally responsible, and capable of revising ourselves according to our moral reasoning (Wolf 1987). Similarly, Paul Benson’s early accounts of autonomy also advocated a strong substantive account, stressing normative competence, and also the threat of oppressive or inappropriate socialization to our normative competence and thus to our autonomy (Benson 1991).

Contemporary Kantians such as Thomas Hill and Christine Korsgaard also advocate substantive accounts of autonomy. Korsgaard argues that we have practical identities which guide us and serve as the source of our normative commitments (Korsgaard 1996). We have multiple such identities, not all of which are moral, but our most general practical identity is as a member of the “kingdom of ends,” our identity as moral agents. This identity generates universal duties and obligations. Just as Kant called autonomy our capacity for self-legislation, so too Korsgaard calls autonomy our capacity to give ourselves obligations to act based on our practical identities. Since one of these is a universal moral identity, autonomy itself thus has substantive content.

Autonomy, for Hill, means that principles will not simply be accepted because of tradition or authority, but can be challenged through reason. He acknowledges that in our society we do not experience the kind of consensus about values and principles that Kant supposed ideally rational legislators might possess, but argues that it is still possible to bear in mind the perspective of a possible kingdom of ends. Human dignity, the idea of humanity as an end in itself, can represent a shared end regardless of background or tradition (Hill 2000, 43-45).

Substantive accounts have been criticized for conflating personal and moral autonomy and for setting too high a bar for autonomous action. If too much is expected of autonomous agents’ self-awareness and moral reflection, then can any of us be truly said to be autonomous (see for example Christman 2004 and Narayan 2002)? Does arguing that agents living under conditions of oppressive socialization have reduced autonomy help set a standard for promotion of justice, or does it overemphasize their diminished capacity without encouraging and promoting the capacities that they do have? This interplay between our socialization and our capacity for autonomy is highlighted in the relational autonomy literature, covered below.

In order to come to some middle ground between substantive and procedural accounts, Paul Benson has also suggested a weak substantive account, which does not specify any content, but sets the requirement that the agent must regard himself or herself as worthy to act; in other words, that the agent must have self-trust, self-respect (Benson 1991). This condition serves to limit what behavior can be deemed autonomous and to bring it in line with our intuition that a mind-controlled or utterly submissive agent is not acting autonomously, while not ruling out the agent’s ability to decide what values he or she wants to live by.

3. Feminist Philosophy of Autonomy

a. Feminist Criticisms of Autonomy

Feminist philosophers have been critical of concepts and values traditionally seen to be gender neutral, finding that when examined they reveal themselves to be masculine (see Jaggar 1983, Benjamin 1988, Grimshaw 1986, Harding and Hintikka 2003, and Lloyd 1986). Autonomy has long been coded masculine and associated with masculine ideals, despite being something which women have called for in their own right. Jessica Benjamin argues that while we are formally committed to equality, “gender polarity underlies such familiar dualisms as autonomy and dependency” (Benjamin 1988, 7). There has been some debate over whether autonomy is actually a useful value for women, or whether it has been tarnished by association.

Gilligan’s criticisms of autonomy have already been covered, but Benjamin writes along similar lines that:

The ideal of the autonomous individual could only be created by abstracting from the relationship of dependency between men and women. The relationships which people require to nurture them are considered private, and not truly relationships with outside others. Thus the other is reduced to an appendage of the subject – the mere condition of his being – not a being in her own right. The individual who cannot recognize the other or his own dependency without suffering a threat to his identity requires the formal, impersonal principle of rationalized interaction, and is required by them. (Benjamin 1988, 197)

Benjamin ultimately argues that the entire structure of recognition between men and women must be altered in order to permit an end to domination. Neither Gilligan nor Benjamin addresses the possibility of reformulating the notion of autonomy itself, but each sees it as essentially linked with individualism and separation. Sarah Hoagland is more emphatic: she openly rejects autonomy as a value, referring to it as “a thoroughly noxious concept” as it “encourages us to believe that connecting and engaging with others limits us” (Hoagland 1988, 144).

These criticisms have been countered, however, by feminists looking to retain the value of autonomy, who argue that the critics conflate the ideal of “autonomy” with that of “substantive independence.” Autonomy, while it has often been associated with individualism and independence, does not necessarily entail these. Most feminist criticism of autonomy is based on the idea that autonomy implies a particular model or expectation of the self. Marilyn Friedman and John Christman, however, point out that the proceduralist notion of autonomy which is the focus of contemporary philosophical attention does not have such an implication, but is metaphysically neutral and value neutral (Friedman 2000, 37-46; Christman 1995).

b. Relational Autonomy

A feminist attempt to rehabilitate autonomy as a value, and to further underscore the contingency of its relationship to atomistic individualism or independence, emerges in the growing research on “relational autonomy” (Nedelsky 1989, Mackenzie and Stoljar 2000). It addresses the challenge of balancing agency with social embeddedness, without promoting an excessively individualistic liberal atomism, or denying women the agency required to criticize or change their situation. The feminist work on relational autonomy attempts to capture the best of the available positions.

It is worth noting first, for clarity, that there are two levels of relationality at work within relational autonomy: social and relational sources of values, goals, and commitments, and social and relational commitments themselves. While all acknowledge that relationality at both levels is not incompatible with autonomy, not all accounts of relational autonomy require that we pursue social and relational commitments. For instance, on Marilyn Friedman’s account, a person could autonomously choose to be a hermit, despite having been brought up in a family and in a society and having been shaped by that upbringing (Friedman 2003, 94). However other relational autonomy theorists are skeptical about neatly separating the two, because they note that even our unchosen relationships still affect our self-identity and opportunities. They argue that while we need not pursue relationships, we cannot opt out entirely. Anne Donchin demonstrates this with regard to testing for genetically inherited disease (Donchin 2000).

In general, on relational autonomy accounts, autonomy is seen as an ideal by which we can measure how well an agent is able to negotiate his or her pursuit of goals and commitments, some of which may be self-chosen, and some the result of social and relational influences. Social and relational ties are examined in terms of their effect on an agent’s competency in this negotiation: some give strength, others create obstacles, and others are ambiguous. The primary focus of most relational autonomy accounts, however, tends to be less on procedure and more on changing the model of the autonomous self from an individualistic one to one embedded in a social context.

4. Autonomy in Social and Political Context

The value of autonomy can be seen in its social and political context. The idea that our decisions, if made autonomously, are to be respected and cannot be shrugged off, is a valuable one. It concerns the legitimacy of our personal decisions in a social, political, and legislative context.

a. Autonomy and Political Theory

The importance and nature of the value of autonomy is debated within political theory, but is generally intertwined with the right to pursue one’s interests without undue restriction. Discussions about the value of autonomy concern the extent of this right, and how it can be seen as compatible with social needs.

Kant described the protection of autonomy at the political level as encapsulated in the principle of right: that each person had the right to any action that can coexist with the freedom of every other person in accordance with universal law (Kant 1996, 387). Mill’s On Liberty similarly defends the rights of individuals to pursue their own personal goals, and emphasizes the need for being one’s own person (Mill 1956). On his view, this right prohibits paternalism, or restrictions or interference with a person of mature age for his or her own benefit. As Mill writes, “The only part of the conduct of anyone for which he is amenable to society is that which concerns others. In the part which merely concerns himself, his independence is, of right, absolute. Over himself, over his own body and mind, the individual is sovereign” (Mill 1956, 13).

Non-interference is generally seen as key to political autonomy; Gerald Gaus specifies that “the fundamental liberal principle” is “that all interferences with action stand in need of justification” (Gaus 2005, 272). If any paternalistic interference is to be permitted, it is generally restricted to cases where the agent is not deemed to be autonomous with respect to a decision (see for example Dworkin 1972); autonomy serves as a bar to be reached in order for an agent’s decisions to be protected (Christman 2004). The question is then how high the bar ought to be set, and thus what individual actions count as autonomous for the purposes of establishing social policy. Because of this, there is a strong connection between personal and political autonomy.

Further, there is also a connection between political liberalism and content-neutral accounts of autonomy which do not require any predetermined values for the agent to be recognized as autonomous. As Christman and Anderson point out, content-neutral accounts of autonomy accord with liberalism’s model of accommodating pluralism in ways of life, values, and traditions (Christman and Anderson 2005).

The framework of seeing the value of political autonomy in terms of protecting individual choices and decisions, however, has been criticized by those who argue that it rests on an inadequate model of the self.

Communitarians such as Michael Sandel criticize the model of the autonomous self implicit in liberal political theory, arguing that it does not provide an adequate notion of the human person as embedded within and shaped by societal values and commitments. Procedural accounts of autonomous decision-making do not adequately recognize the way our relational commitments shape us. We do not choose our values and commitments from the position of already being autonomous individuals; in other words, the autonomous self does not exist prior to the values and commitments that constitute the basis for its decisions. To deliberate in the abstract from these values and commitments is to leave out the self’s very identity, and that which gives meaning to the deliberation (Sandel 1998).

Feminist scholars have agreed with some of the communitarian criticism, but also caution that the values and commitments that communitarians appeal to may not be ones that are in line with feminist goals, in particular those values that concern the role and makeup of the family (Okin 1989 and Weiss 1995).

Another criticism of the dominant model of autonomy within political theory is made by Martha Fineman, who argues for the need to rethink the conceptions of autonomy that undergird legal and governmental policies in order to better recognize our interdependence and the dependence of all of us upon society (Fineman 2004, 28-30). While not drawing on the philosophical literature on personal autonomy or relational autonomy, but rather drawing upon sociological theories and accounts of legal and government policy, she traces the historical and cultural associations of autonomy with individuality and masculinity, and argues the need to see that real human flourishing includes dependency.

Recognizing the different levels of autonomy at play within the political sphere as a whole can help to clarify what is at stake, and to avoid one-sided accounts of autonomy or the autonomous self. Rainer Forst outlines five different conceptions of autonomy that can combine into a multidimensional account (Forst 2005). The first is moral autonomy, in which an agent can be considered autonomous as long as he or she “acts on the basis of reasons that take every other power equally into account” and which are “justifiable on the basis of reciprocally and generally binding norms” (Forst 2005, 230). Even though this is an interpersonal norm, it is relevant to the political, argues Forst, because it promotes the mutual respect needed for political liberty. Ethical autonomy concerns a person’s desires in the quest for the good life, in the context of the person’s values, commitments, relationships, and communities. Legal autonomy is thus the right not to be forced into a particular set of values and commitments, and is neutral toward them. Political autonomy concerns the right to participate in collective self-rule, exercised with the other members of the relevant community. Finally, social autonomy concerns whether an agent has the means to be an equal member of this community. Attending to social autonomy helps to demonstrate the responsibility of members of the community to consider each other’s needs, and to evaluate political and social structures in terms of whether they serve to promote the social autonomy of all of the members. Forst argues that ultimately “citizens are politically free to the extent to which they, as freedom-grantors and freedom-users, are morally, ethically, legally, politically, and socially autonomous members of a political community … Rights and liberties therefore have to be justified not only with respect to one conception of autonomy but with a complex understanding of what it means to be an autonomous person” (Forst 2005, 238).

Whether or not one agrees with this particular way of dividing the conceptions of autonomy, or with the particular explanation of the details of any of the conceptions, Forst’s account highlights the way that understanding the contribution of autonomy to political theory involves a multifaceted approach. It is of limited use to say that citizens are autonomous because they have the right to vote, if their material needs are not met, or if they are not free in their choice of values or ethical commitments.  Taking ethical autonomy into consideration can help to meet some of the concerns raised above by communitarian and feminist critics of autonomy; meanwhile, taking legal autonomy into account alongside ethical autonomy can help to provide the bulwark of protection against oppressive traditions that feminists are concerned about.

This can also be related to the work done by Martha Nussbaum and Amartya Sen on the capabilities approach to human rights, in which societies are called upon to ensure that all human beings have the opportunity to develop certain capabilities; agents then have a choice whether or not to develop them (see for example Sen 1999 and Nussbaum 2006).  The kind of political autonomy granted to subjects, then, depends on their ability to cultivate these various capabilities within a given society.

b. Autonomy and Bioethics

In applied ethics, such as bioethics, autonomy is a key value. It is appealed to by both sides of a number of debates, such as the right to free speech in hate speech versus the right to be free from hate speech (Mackenzie and Stoljar 2000, 4). There is a lack of consensus, however, on how autonomy ought to be used: how much rationality it requires, whether it merely involves the negative right against interference or whether it involves positive duties of moral reflection and self-legislation.

Autonomy has long been an important principle within biomedical ethics. For example, in the Belmont report, published in 1979 in the United States, which articulates guidelines for experimentation on human subjects, the protection of subjects’ autonomy is enshrined in the principle of “respect for persons.” One of the three key principles of the Report, it states that participants in trials ought to be treated as autonomous, and those with diminished autonomy (due to cognitive or other disabilities or illnesses) are entitled to protection. The way this principle is to be applied takes shape in the form of informed consent, as the Report presumes that this is the best way to protect autonomy.

One of the standard textbooks in biomedical ethics, Principles of Biomedical Ethics by Tom L. Beauchamp and James F. Childress, defends four principles for ethical decision-making, of which “respect for autonomy” is the first, even though it is not intended to override other moral considerations.  The principle can be seen as both a negative and a positive obligation. The negative obligation for health care professionals is that patients’ autonomous decisions should not be constrained by others. The positive obligation calls for “respectful treatment in disclosing information and fostering autonomous decision-making” (Beauchamp and Childress 2001, 64).

Beauchamp and Childress accept that a patient can autonomously choose to be guided by religious, traditional, or community norms and values. While they acknowledge that it can be difficult to negotiate diverse values and beliefs in sharing information necessary for decision-making, this does not excuse a failure to respect a patient’s autonomous decision: “respect for autonomy is not a mere ideal in health care; it is a professional obligation. Autonomous choice is a right, not a duty of patients” (Beauchamp and Childress 2001, 63).

Autonomy is also important within the disability rights movement. Within the disability rights movement, the slogan, “Nothing about us without us” is a call for autonomy or self-determination (see Charlton 1998). It goes beyond merely rejecting having decisions made for people with disabilities by others, but also speaks to the desire for empowerment and recognition as being agents capable of self-determination.

The relational approach to autonomy has become popular in the spheres of health care ethics and disability theory. The language of relational autonomy has been helpful in reframing the dichotomy between strict independence and dependence and providing a way of framing the relationship between a person with a disability and his or her caretaker or guardian. It has also been argued that a relational approach to patient autonomy provides a better model of the decision-making process.

Criticisms of a rationalistic and individualistic ideal of autonomy and the development of the idea of relational autonomy have been taken up within the mainstream of biomedical ethics. In response to criticism that early editions of their textbook on biomedical ethics had not paid adequate heed to intimate relationships and the social dimensions of patient autonomy, Beauchamp and Childress emphasize that they “aim to construct a conception of respect for autonomy that is not excessively individualistic (neglecting the social nature of individuals and the impact of individual choices and actions on others), not excessively focused on reason (neglecting the emotions), and not unduly legalistic (highlighting legal rights and downplaying social practices)” (Beauchamp and Childress, 2001, 57).

Their account of autonomy, however, has still been criticized by Anne Donchin as being a “weak concept” of relational autonomy (Donchin 2000). While they do not deny that selves are developed within a context of community and human relationships, agents are still assumed to have consciously chosen their beliefs and values and to be capable of detaching themselves from relationships at will (Donchin 2000, 238). A strong concept of relational autonomy, on the other hand, holds that “there is a social component built into the very meaning of autonomy,” and that autonomy “involves a dynamic balance among interdependent people tied to overlapping projects” (Donchin 2000, 239). The autonomous self is one “continually remaking itself in response to relationships that are seldom static,” and which “exists fundamentally in relation to others” (Donchin 2000, 239). Donchin argues that it is the strong concept of relational autonomy that offers the most helpful account of decision-making in health care.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Barvosa-Carter, Edwina. “Mestiza Autonomy as Relational Autonomy: Ambivalence and the Social Character of Free Will,” The Journal of Political Philosophy Vol. 15, no. 1 (2007), 1-21.
  • Beauchamp, Tom L. and James F. Childress. Principles of Biomedical Ethics, 5th ed, Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press, 2001.
  • Benjamin, Benjamin. The Bonds of Love: Psychoanalysis, Feminism, and the Problem of Domination, New York: Pantheon Books, 1988, 183-224.
  • Benson, Paul. “Autonomy and Oppressive Socialization,” Social Theory and Practice 17, no. 3 (1991), 385-408.
  • Bratman, Michael. Structures of Agency, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
  • Charlton, James I. Nothing About Us Without Us: Disability, Oppression and Empowerment, Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press, 1998.
  • Christman, J., (ed.). The Inner Citadel: Essays on Individual Autonomy, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989.
  • Christman, John, and Joel Anderson (ed.) Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Christman, John. “Autonomy and Personal History,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 21 no. 1(1991), 1-24.
  • Christman, John. “Autonomy, Self-Knowledge, and Liberal Legitimacy,” in Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism, ed. John Christman and Joel Anderson, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Christman, John. “Feminism and Autonomy,” “Nagging” Questions: Feminist Ethics in Every Life, ed. Dana E. Bushnell. Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield Publishers, Inc., 1995, 17-39.
  • Christman, John. “Relational Autonomy, Liberal Individualism, and the Social Constitution of Selves,” Philosophical Studies 117, no. 1-2 (2004), 143-164.
  • Critchley, Simon. Infinitely Demanding: Ethics of Commitment, Politics of Resistance, London: Verso, 2007.
  • Donchin, Anne. "Autonomy and Interdependence: Quandaries in Genetic Decision Making." In Relational Autonomy: Feminist Perspectives on Autonomy, Agency, and the Social Self, edited by Catriona Mackenzie and Natalie Stoljar, 236-258. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Dworkin, Gerald. “Paternalism,” The Monist, 56 no. 1 (1972), 64-84.
  • Dworkin, Gerald. The Theory and Practice of Autonomy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
  • Dworkin, Gerald. “The Concept of Autonomy,” in The Inner Citadel, ed. John Christman, 54-62.
  • Ekstrom, Laura. “A Coherence Theory of Autonomy,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 53 (1993), 599–616.
  • Fineman, Martha Albertson. The Autonomy Myth: A Theory of Dependency. New York: The New Press, 2004.
  • Forst, Rainer. “Political Liberty: Integrating Five Conceptions of Autonomy,” in Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism, 2005, 226-242.
  • Frankfurt, Harry. The Importance of What We Care About, ed. Harry Frankfurt, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
  • Friedman, Marilyn. "Autonomy and the Split-Level Self," Southern Journal of Philosophy 24 (1986), 19-35.
  • Friedman, Marilyn. Autonomy, Gender, Politics, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003.
  • Gaus, Gerald F. “The Place of Autonomy Within Liberalism,” in Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism, 2005, 272-306.
  • Gilligan, Carol. In a Different Voice: Psychological Theory and Women's Development. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1982.
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Author Information

Jane Dryden
Mount Allison University

The American Environmental Justice Movement

The origin of the American environmental justice movement can be traced back to the emergence of the American Civil Rights movement of the 1960s, and more specifically to the U.S. Civil Rights Act of 1964.  The movement reached a new level with the emergence of Robert Bullard’s work entitled Dumping in Dixie in the 1990’s, which constituted a clarion call for environmental justice. Although environmentalism and the environmental justice movement are related, there is a difference.  Environmentalism is concerned with humanity’s adverse impact upon the environment, but proponents are primarily concerned with the impact of an unhealthy environment thrust upon a collective body of life, entailing both human and non-human existence, including in some instances plant life.  The efforts of the environmental justice movement differ from those of the environmentalist movement in that, at the heart of environmental injustice, there are issues of racism and socio-economic injustice.  Although environmentalism focuses upon and acknowledges the negative impact of humanity’s actions upon the environment, the environmental justice movement builds upon the philosophy and work of environmentalism by stressing the manner in which adversely impacting the environment in turn adversely impacts the population of that environment.

Table of Contents

  1. The Definition of Environmental Justice
  2. History of the Environmental Justice Movement
  3. Environmental Racism and Environmental Justice
  4. Principles of the Environmental Justice Movement
  5. Causes of Environmental Injustice
  6. Major Events in the Environmental Justice Movement
  7. Environmental Justice Policy and Law
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Books
    2. Journals
    3. Governmental and Legal Publications

1. The Definition of Environmental Justice

Although the origin of the environmental justice movement is traced to the passing of the Civil Rights Act of 1964, Robert Bullard’s work entitled Dumping in Dixie published in the 1990’s is considered to be the first book addressing the reality of environmental injustice.  The work examines the widening economic, health and environmental disparities between racial groups and socioeconomic groups at the end of the twentieth and the beginning of the twenty-first centuries.  Bullard states that in writing the book he operated with the assumption that all Americans have a basic right to live, work, play, go to school and worship in a clean and healthy environment (DD, xii).  Bullard’s analysis in Dumping in Dixie “chronicles the emergence of the environmental justice movement in an effort to develop common strategies that are supportive of building sustainable African American communities and other people of color communities.”  (DD, xiii).

Bullard’s wife, a practicing attorney, suggested that he study the spatial location of all the municipal solid-waste disposal facilities in Houston, Texas. This was done as part of a class-action lawsuit filed by Bullard’s wife against the city of Houston, the State of Texas, and Browning Ferris Industries.  The lawsuit originated from a plan to site a municipal landfill in a suburban, middle-income neighborhood of single-family homeowners. The lawsuit became known as Bearn v. Southwestern Waste Management and was the first lawsuit in the United States charging environmental discrimination in waste facility location under the Civil Rights Act. The Northwood Manor neighborhood consisted of over 82 percent African American residents (DD, xii).

The emergence of the environmental justice movement is directly linked to the environmental movement.  Some contend that environmentalism and the environmental justice movement are so interrelated that the movement has essentially redefined the nature of environmentalism. According to Bullard, an environmental revolution is taking shape in the United States which “has touched communities of color from New York to California and from Florida to Alaska” and any location “where African Americans, Latinos, Asians, Pacific Islanders, and Native Americans live and comprise a major portion of the population” (CER, 7).  The influence of the environmental justice movement has broadened the spectrum of environmentalism to include what might be regarded as the trivialities of life, according to Bullard. This includes activities such as play and attending school. It also has implications for something as simple as where humans, animals and plants reside. Bullard points out that the environmental justice movement in the United States focuses upon a diversity of areas including wilderness and wildlife preservation, resource conservation, pollution abatement and population control (DD, 1). The environmental justice movement served to interrelate the physical, social, and cultural dimensions of human, non-human and plant existence under the rubric of environmentalism in general and environmental justice in particular.   (Bullard, 1999) The environmental justice movement has indirectly heightened concern not only for human existence, but also for animals and plant life.  The reality is that no single definition of environmental justice exists. However, a significant legal definition used by the Environmental Protection Agency describes environmental justice as:

[T]he fair treatment and meaningful involvement of all people regardless of race, ethnicity, income, national origin, or educational level with respect to the development, implementation and enforcement of environmental laws, regulations and policies. Fair treatment means that no population, due to policy or economic disempowerment, is forced to bear a disproportionate burden of the negative human health or environmental impacts of pollution or other environmental consequences resulting from industrial, municipal, and commercial operations or the execution of federal, state, local, and tribal programs and policies (EPA, 2).

The environmental justice movement is concerned with the pursuit of social justice and the preamble to the Principles of environmental justice adopted at the First National People of Color Environmental Leadership Summit in Washington D.C., 1991 reflects the primacy of this concern.  According to the environmental justice movement, all Americans, regardless of whether they are white or black, rich or poor, are entitled to equal protection under the law.  The  environmental justice advocates for quality education, employment, and housing, as well as the health of physical environments in which individuals, families and groups live (DD, 7).

While the environmental justice movement is rooted in significant philosophical/sociological underpinnings, the movement strives to be intensely practical. Few environmentalists realize the sociologic implications of what has been termed the “not-in-my-backyard” phenomenon which entails the recognition of the reality that hazardous waste, garbage dumps and polluting industries will inevitably be located in someone’s backyard.  The question then emerges as to whose and which backyards these toxic entities will be located? Bullard concluded based upon sociological analysis that these entities frequently end up in poor, powerless, black communities rather than affluent suburbs and he adds that this has been the case repeatedly (DD, 4).

It is important to note that the movement is critical of Western theories of jurisprudence and philosophy, which are founded upon Kantian, Cartesian and Lockean assumptions. For instance, Kantian jurisprudence is committed to the idea of the universality of rules in addressing a wide range of moral issues, whereas Cartesian dualism devalues the significance of physical existence and threats to that existence, and the philosophical conclusions of John Locke preserves individualism at the expense of the collective group. The environmental justice movement rejects each of these, concluding that no universal law or rule can be applied in a diversity of moral contexts, that the physical existence of a collective body is to be aggressively protected, and, finally, that no one individual or particular group is to be victimized for the benefit of another.  In short, such theories do not "embrace the whole community of life as the relevant moral community" (Rasmussen, 12).  Not only do these traditional philosophical underpinnings of the Western worldview fail to include members of the total human community, these approaches also fail to acknowledge the significance of life in the non-human sphere.

It is also important to note that environmental justice advocates reject the Rawlsian understanding of justice as "fairness".  In acknowledging the reality of social, economic and moral inequity, Rawls argued that these inequities must be based upon the condition of benefit to the least advantaged. In the philosophy of the environmental justice movement, however, to adopt Rawls’ definition of justice and to tolerate the existence of actual instances of inequities and injustice based upon benefit to the collective victims reflects a perpetuation of centuries of oppression, which have become part and parcel of inadequate and distorted forms of institutional decision-making (Deane Drummond, 10). Furthermore, for environmental justice proponents, "justice is justice as distribution, recognition, and participation, linked in ways that address the wellbeing of the whole community of life in a given locale" (Rasmussen, 17).

Part of the uniqueness of the environmental justice movement is the focus on injustice as a collective experience.  Consequently, those in the movement strive for the actual pursuit, promotion, and establishment of better living conditions in the midst of collective entities, both human and non-human.  As such, at its very core the environmental justice movement is transformational and strives to empower collective victims of environmental injustice with the capacity for self-provision, self-organization, and self-governance (Rasmussen, 17).

In addition and as previously indicated, there is an important distinction to be made between environmentalism and the environmental justice movement.  While environmentalism is concerned with environmental injustice and the pursuit of justice, it is primarily concerned with the abuse of the environment by a hierarchical model which places humanity at the top with the result being the abuse of nature.  On the other hand, environmental justice advocates are more concerned with what is termed "social ecology" or "human welfare ecology." Their primary concern is the impact of institutional systemic flaws which are the natural result of a progression of historical events resulting in decisions which establish unjust living conditions upon one group of people due to a lack of organization, power and prominence. At the risk of oversimplification, whereas environmentalism is concerned with humanity’s adverse impact upon the environment, environmental justice proponents are primarily concerned with the impact of an unhealthy environment thrust upon a collective body of life, both human and non-human, including in some instances plant life. The efforts of the environmental justice movement go beyond those of the environmentalism movement.

Environmental justice advocates contend that instances of environmental injustice are not simply arbitrary realities which occur in varying contexts.  Rather, instances of environmental injustice are the outcome of an institutional oppression and isolation which have set up an inevitable framework of the powerful oppressing the powerless. The victims, through a significant occurrence of historical and social realities, have been cut off from the power required even to challenge the causes of environmental injustice.  In a very real sense, the environmental justice movement represents another dimension of social liberation, which attempts to protect victims from institutional and systemic oppression. However, the task of the environmental justice movement should not be understood only in terms of the negative.  The central and positive question of the environmental justice movement is, "What constitutes healthy, livable, sustainable, and viable communities in the place we live, work, and play as the outcome of interrelated natural, built, social, and cultural/spiritual environments?" (Lee, 141-44).

The environmental justice movement also understands environmental injustice as part of a history of oppression and contends that profound historical realities predating the contemporary context of human existence in the Western world lie at the root of environmental injustice.  Advocates of environmental justice contend that the lack of power on the part of the victims of environmental injustice have a direct relationship of continuity with events emerging from the recent civil rights issues, to the civil war, and even trace the root cause of the systemic lack of power by certain groups to the impact of European-based realities which continue to shape the modern context of environmental injustice.  Environmental justice proponents focus upon what is termed "the four interlocking C's" which have led to the exploitation of particular groups of people.  These "C's" are conquest, colonization, commerce, and Christian implantation.

The call for environmental justice focuses on both environmental and ecological economics, which are reflected respectively in the work of environmental economics advocates such as Herman Daly, John Kenneth Galbraith and Nicholas Georgescu-Roegen, and ecological economics advocates such as Rebecca Pates and John Hagan.  While the environmental justice movement is primarily concerned with issues related to the United States, any consideration of the movement must acknowledge the contributions of these individuals and others and their work regarding global considerations since many of the issues with which the environmental justice movement is concerned are also contained within movements outside the United States dialogue and debate.

2. History of the Environmental Justice Movement

The environmental justice movement originated with the passing of the Civil Rights Act of 1964 and of Title VI, which prohibited the use of federal funds to discriminate on the basis of race, color and national origin.  The movement is also related to the work of Dr. Martin Luther King in the late 1960’s and his efforts on behalf of black sanitation workers in the city of Memphis, Tennessee.  In 1969, Ralph Abascal of the California Rural Legal Assistance filed a suit on behalf of six migrant farm workers, which resulted in the banning of the pesticide DDT. In addition, Congress passed the National Environmental Policy Act (NEPA) that same year.  In 1971, the President’s Council on Environmental Quality (CEQ) acknowledged racial discrimination which adversely affected urban poor and the quality of their environment.  In 1978, the Houston Northwood Manor subdivision residents protested the Whispering Pines Sanitary Landfill and in 1979 Linda McKeever Bullard filed a lawsuit on behalf of Houston’s Northeast Community Action Group. This lawsuit, titled Bean v. Southwestern Waste Management Inc, constituted the first civil rights suit challenging the siting of a waste facility.  The United Church of Christ Commission for Racial Justice issued the “Toxic Waste and Race in the United States” report in 1987.  The report was the first national study exposing the relationship between waste facility location and race.  The Clean Air Act was passed in 1990 and Bullard’s book Dumping in Dixie was published in the same year.  This particular work constituted the first textbook on environmental justice.  The first National People of Color Environmental Leadership Summit was held in Washington in 1991.  In 1994, The Environmental Justice Resource Center was formed at Clark Atlanta University in Atlanta, Georgia.  In addition, during the same year the Washington Office on Environmental Justice (WOEJ) opened in Washington D.C.  The United States environmental justice movement progressed onto the global stage in 1995 when environmental justice delegates participated in the 4th World Conference on Women in Beijing.

The environmental justice movement has existed for more than two decades, reaching an apex in the 1990’s. The movement emerged from an increased awareness of the disproportionately high impacts of environmental pollution on economically and politically disadvantaged communities. It addresses issues such as social, economic and political marginalization of minorities and low income populations, and is also concerned with the perceived increase of pollution not only in neighborhoods and communities, but also in the workplace.

There is no specific founding point for the environmental justice movement, but it was largely created through the fusion of two other movements — the economic analysis of the anti-toxics movement and the racial critique of the Civil Rights movement — and the over-arching perspective of a third — faith. Other strong contributions have come from  academia, from Native Americans, and the labor. (Timeline)

African Americans did not significantly challenge the environmental problems adversely affecting their communities prior to the call for environmental justice.  The shift from denial to acknowledgment and action emerged during the 1980’s.  Until that time African American resistance was largely limited to concern with local issues and generally was concerned with the individualistic nature of the African American struggle for equality.  However, in the 1980’s a transition took place which would give rise to the environmental justice movement as an extension of the Civil Rights movement.  This shift took place under the designation of “environmental activism” (DD, 29).

The environmental justice movement is credited with having begun in Warren County, North Carolina. In this locale residents demonstrated against a landfill which would be placed in their county. The reaction of the citizens concerning the issue reflected the merging of civil rights activists and environmentalists. Representatives from these two groups are alleged to have laid down in front of trucks transferring large amounts of PCB-contaminated soil into the largely African American populated area of Warren County. While the Warren County demonstrations were unsuccessful, they did achieve the result of bringing a renewed focus to the issue of the disproportionately high impact of environmental pollution upon minority communities such as Warren County. Ultimately, this event also placed environmental justice concerns onto the political agenda.

In 1992, a National Law Journal report alleged that the Environmental Protection Agency (EPA) had discriminated in its enforcement of environmental protection law thereby supporting the observations of those among whom the movement originally emerged.  The report indicated that federal fines were more lax for industries operating in communities of color. In addition, the report also contended that the cleanup of environmental disasters in communities of color were much slower than those carried out in the context of wealthier white communities.  Furthermore, the report indicated that standards for clean up in communities of color were not as well established or rigid as those applied in white communities.

3. Environmental Racism and Environmental Justice

Environmental justice advocates argue that an intimate relationship exists between the trilogy of environmental racism, environmental discrimination, and environmental policymaking.  Environmental injustice and environmental racism have their roots in a politico-institutional context bent toward discrimination.  Municipal, state, and federal regulations are, therefore, aimed at permitting, condoning and even promoting environmental racism.

In addition, environmental justice proponents contend that governmental policy is also bent toward the deliberate targeting of communities of color for toxic waste disposal and also the establishing of polluting industries in those communities. Further, policy and legislation not only permit but also endorse the official sanctioning of life-threatening poisons and pollutants being located in communities of color. Environmental justice advocates also contend that residents of victimized people groups are ostracized from access to political power and consequently have been excluded from service on decision-making boards and regulatory bodies, thereby subtly yet deliberately promoting environmental injustice and environmental racism.  Each of these elements contributes to the existence and propagation of environmental injustice and environmental racism (CER, 3).

Environmental justice proponents contend, "Experiences of environmental racism and injustice are not random, nor are they individual." Consequently, the environmental justice movement is concerned with these two matters, collectivism and perceived intentionality.  On the one hand, environmental justice advocates concern themselves with environmental injustice as it happens to groups; and on the other hand, environmental justice advocates are also concerned with the systemic causes of environmental injustice (Rasmussen, 3-4).

Robert Bullard states that race is a major factor in predicting the placement of Locally Unwanted Land Uses (LULUs). Some would contend that socio-economic class is the central issue, however. Bullard counters that while race and class are combined factors, race is still the predominant factor. Environmental justice activists pronounce that race dominates policy decisions made by those in positions of power since the power arrangements of socio-economic institutions are out of balance.

Bullard also advances that environmental justice is not a social program, nor is it an affirmative action program and also that ultimately the central concern of the movement is the implementation of justice.  In addition, Bullard maintains that the consideration of race in the environmental justice movement, while constituting a portion of the problematic equation associated with environmental injustice is not the only concern of the movement.

We are just as much concerned with inequities in Appalachia, for example, where the whites are basically dumped on because of lack of economic and political clout and lack of having a voice to say 'no' and that's environmental injustice.  We are trying to work with folks across the political spectrums; democrats, republicans, independents, on the reservations, in the barrios, in the ghettos, on the border and internationally to se what we address these issues in a comprehensive manner. (Interview)

However, in his earlier work entitled Confronting Environmental Racism: Voices from the Grassroots, Bullard does give voice to his belief that the problem of environmental injustice is to a large extent a racially oriented problem and that this is a problem which communities of color face.  He couches his discussion concerning environmental justice in the context of the recognition that at the heart of the problem of environmental injustice is a racially divided nation in which extreme racial inequalities persist.  However, by the time of Bullard’s more major work entitled Dumping in Dixie, he had acknowledged that the reality of environmental injustice transcends the issue of the victimization of any one race or ethnic group (CER, 7).

4. Principles of the Environmental Justice Movement

The result of the 1992 National Law Journal report concluded that the EPA had discriminated in its enforcement of Environmental Protection Law Report, which was intended to remedy the reality of environmental racism in the United States. Consequently, in 1991 at the First National People of Color Leadership Summit meeting in Washington D.C., the Principles of Environmental Justice were adopted.  These principles represent an initial rallying cry on behalf of those inhabitants, human and non-human, who are the victims of environmental injustice, and eventually established a context for a guide to action regarding governmental legislation.  Those principles are:

  1. Environmental justice affirms the sacredness of Mother Earth, ecological unity and the interdependence of all species, and the right to be free from ecological destruction.
  2. Environmental justice demands that public policy be based on mutual respect and justice for all peoples, free from any form of discrimination or bias.
  3. Environmental justice mandates the right to ethical, balanced and responsible uses of land and renewable resources in the interest of a sustainable planet for humans and other living things.
  4. Environmental justice calls for universal protection from nuclear testing, extraction, production and disposal of toxic/hazardous wastes and poisons and nuclear testing that threaten the fundamental right to clean air, land, water, and food.
  5. Environmental justice affirms the fundamental right to political, economic, cultural and environmental self-determination of all peoples.
  6. Environmental justice demands the cessation of the production of all toxins, hazardous wastes, and radioactive materials, and that all past and current producers be held strictly accountable to the people for detoxification and the containment at the point of production.
  7. Environmental justice demands the right to participate as equal partners at every level of decision-making including needs assessment, planning, implementation, enforcement and evaluation.
  8. Environmental justice affirms the right of all workers to a safe and healthy work environment, without being forced to choose between an unsafe livelihood and unemployment. It also affirms the right of those who work at home to be free from environmental hazards.
  9. Environmental justice protects the right of victims of environmental injustice to receive full compensation and reparations for damages as well as quality health care.
  10. Environmental justice considers governmental acts of environmental injustice a violation of international law, the Universal Declaration on Human Rights, and the United Nations Convention on Genocide.
  11. Environmental justice must recognize a special legal and natural relationship of Native Peoples to the U.S. government through treaties, agreements, compacts, and covenants affirming sovereignty and self-determination.
  12. Environmental justice affirms the need for urban and rural ecological policies to clean up and rebuild our cities and rural areas in balance with nature, honoring the cultural integrity of all our communities, and providing fair access for all to the full range of resources.
  13. Environmental justice calls for the strict enforcement of principles of informed consent, and a halt to the testing of experimental reproductive and medical procedures and vaccinations on people of color.
  14. Environmental justice opposes the destructive operations of multi-national corporations.
  15. Environmental justice opposes military occupation, repression and exploitation of lands, peoples and cultures, and other life forms.
  16. Environmental justice calls for the education of present and future generations, which emphasizes social and environmental issues, based on our experience and an appreciation of our diverse cultural perspectives.
  17. Environmental justice requires that we, as individuals, make personal and consumer choices to consume as little of Mother Earth's resources and to produce as little waste as possible; and make the conscious decision to challenge and reprioritize our lifestyles to insure the health of the natural world for present and future generations (ejnet).

The First National People of Color Leadership Summit brought together hundreds of environmental justice activists representing both the national as well as the global stage.  The objective of the conference was to advocate for local and regional environmental justice activism in the form of both regional and ethnic networks. The Summit led to the creation of the Asian Pacific Environmental Network, the Northeast Environmental Justice Network, the Southern Organizing Committee for Economic and Environmental Justice and the Midwest/Great Lakes Environmental Justice Network. In 1993 Max Baucus, Democrat from Montana introduced the Environmental Justice Act of 1993 that addressed assertions that poor and minority areas are disproportionately affected by environmental pollution.  Representative John Lewis, Democrat from Georgia introduced a similar bill in the House of Representatives.

5. Causes of Environmental Injustice

Environmental injustice is said to exist when members of disadvantaged ethnic minority or other groups suffer disproportionately at the local, regional (subnational), or national levels from environmental risks or hazards or from violations of fundamental human rights as a result of environmental factors.  In addition, environmental injustice has occurred when an individual or group of individuals is denied access to environmental investments, benefits, and natural resources.  Furthermore, environmental injustice has taken place when individuals or collective groups are denied access to information, and/or participation in decision-making, as well as access to justice in environment-related matters. The study of environmental injustice has the responsibilities of examining the hierarchies of power that are inherent in any given socio-cultural context and the manner in which those hierarchies not only tolerate but also propagate environmental injustice against any number of disadvantaged people groups (EIPS, 2).

One cause of environmental injustice is institutionalized racism.  Institutionalized racism is defined as the practical reality of deliberately and intentionally targeting neighborhoods and communities comprised of a majority of people of low socio-economic status and of a collective group of individuals of color and is considered to be the natural outgrowth of racism. According to environmental justice proponents, this racism has become acculturated and engrained in contemporary social institutions, not the least of which is a governmental bureaucracy on the municipal, state, and federal levels which not only permits but reinforces the imposition of environmental injustice upon these groups.  Bunyan Bryant defines environmental racism as "the systematic exclusion of people of color from environmental decisions affecting their communities" (Bryant, 5 and Rasmussen, 8).

Another factor leading to the reality of environmental injustice is the commoditization of land, water, energy and air. This has resulted in their being secured and protected for the benefit of those in power over those who lack power.  Advocates of environmental justice remind that regardless of our status in life, we all exist collectively within the context of this biosphere.  Therefore "we breathe the same air, share the same atmosphere with the same ozone layer and climate patterns, eat food from the same soils and seas, and harvest the same acid rain" (Rasmussen, 8).

In addition, the unresponsive and unaccountable governmental policies and regulations which exist at all levels of government contribute to environmental racism and environmental injustice. Government authorities are frequently unresponsive to community needs regarding environmental inequities due to the existence of an oppressive power structure.  Furthermore, governmental availability to powerful corporations who exert power as an act of self-interest also poses problems.  Consequently, the victims of environmental injustice find it difficult if not impossible to use governmental resources and power to advance their cause (Rasmussen, 8).

Moreover, the lack of resources and power in affected communities is a major contributor to the presence of environmental racism.  In addition to the previous obstacles is the common denominator of powerlessness on the part of the victimized on the basis of few financial resources to invest in the struggle for environmental justice and also the lack of power by the victims of environmental injustice.  Specifically, the groups adversely affected by environmental inequities lack the capacity to function as an organized block representing their interests against those in the contest of authority and affluence (Rasmussen, 8).

Finally, a piecemeal approach to regulation which allows loopholes and the consequent ongoing victimization of low-income populations of color contributes to the reality of environmental racism.  The ongoing process of governmental regulation also poses a problem in combating environmental injustice and the implementation of environmental justice.  The consequent gaps between pieces of legislation which are passed in an effort to combat environmental injustice frequently provide a context for the skirting the intent of this legislation (Rasmussen, 8).

6. Major Events in the Environmental Justice Movement

A major event contributing to the development of the environmental movement in the United States was the National Environmental Policy Act of 1969 (NEPA).  The Act established a foundation for United States environmental policy and required that "any major federal action significantly affecting the quality of the human environment" requires evaluation and public disclosure of potential environmental impact through the required Environmental Impact Statement (EIS).  The EIS required by NEPA applies broadly to such categories as highways and other forms of transit projects and programs, natural resource leasing and extraction, industrial farming and policies governing genetically modified crops, as well as large scale urban development projects (NEPA 1969).  NEPA was signed into law on January 1, 1970. The Act establishes national environmental policy and goals for the protection, maintenance, and enhancement of the environment and it provides a process for implementing these goals within the federal agencies.

NEPA also established the Council on Environmental Quality (CEQ).  In its 1971 annual report, CEQ noted that populations of low-income people of color were disproportionately exposed to significant environmental hazards. This recognition constitutes the earliest governmental report acknowledging the existence of what may be termed environmental inequality in the United States.  In 1983 Robert Bullard published his groundbreaking case study of waste disposal practices in Houston, Texas entitled "Solid Waste Sites and the Black Houston Community." The case study resulted in the publication of Bullard's Dumping in Dixie: Race, Class, and Environmental Quality in1990. Bullard's original study discovered that waste sites were not scattered on a random basis throughout the city of Houston, but that they were more likely to be located in African American neighborhoods and even more shockingly near schools.  Bullard's work was the first actual study to examine the causes of environmental racism.  Bullard discovered a multiplicity of factors which led to the environmental inequality including housing discrimination, lack of zoning and racially and socio-economically insensitive decisions made by public officials over a period of fifty years.

In 1983, further documenting the realities of environmental discrimination, a congressionally authorized U.S. General Accounting Office study uncovered that three out of four off-site, commercial hazardous waste landfills in the southeastern United States were located within predominately African American communities. This was the reality despite the fact that African Americans made up only one-fifth of the region’s population. In 1990, sociologist Robert Bullard published his influential work entitled Dumping in Dixie.His was the first major study of environmental racism linking hazardous facility locations with historical patterns of segregation in the South. In addition, Bullard's study was one of the first to explore the social and psychological impacts of environmental racism on local populations, as well as acknowledging the emerging environmental justice movement as a response from the communities against these increasingly documented environmental threats.

On February 11, 1994, President Bill Clinton signed Executive Order 12898, Federal Actions to Address Environmental Justice in Minority Populations and Low-Income Populations, to focus federal attention on the environmental and human health conditions of minority and low-income populations with the goal of achieving environmental protection for all communities. The Order directed federal agencies to develop environmental justice strategies to help federal agencies address disproportionately high and adverse human health or environmental effects of their programs on minority and low-income populations. The order is also intended to promote nondiscrimination in federal programs that affect human health and the environment. It aims to provide minority and low-income communities with access to public information and public participation in matters relating to human health and the environment. The Presidential Memorandum accompanying the Order underscores certain provisions of existing law that can help ensure that all communities and persons across the nation live in a safe and healthy environment. Also in 1994, The Environmental Protection Agency renamed the Office of Environmental Equity as the Office of Environmental Justice. The Environmental Justice Act of 1999 introduced into the U.S. Legislature was also a sign of significant progress. In 2003 the EPA established the environmental justice bibliographic database.

7. Environmental Justice Policy and Law

The environmental justice movement credits its momentum and effectiveness to the U.S. Constitution and three significant pieces of legislation: Title VI 601; 602; and 42 U.S.C. 1983.

The Fourteenth Amendment and Equal Protection

Prior to the establishing of terms such as "environmental justice" or environmental racism", residents living in minority communities who believed they were the victims of unfair environmental policy brought fourteenth amendment actions before local municipalities seeking fair treatment. In Dowdell v. City of Apopka, 1983, discrimination in street paving, water distribution, and storm draining services was established. In United Farm Workers of Florida v. City of Delray Beach, 1974 it was established that there were violations of farm workers' civil rights by city officials. In Johnson v. City of Arcadia, 1978 the court found discrimination in access to paved streets, parks, and the water supply.  The Supreme Court's decision in Washington v. Davis, 1976 announced the rule that impermissible discrimination under the Fourteenth Amendment requires a showing of intent, not simply of disparate impact.  In Village of Arlington Heights v. Metropolitan Housing Development Co., 1977 the Court established a set of factors to determine whether invidious discrimination underlies an otherwise legitimate exercise of government authority.

Title VI, Civil Rights Act 601, 602, and 42 U.S.C. 198

Title VI, Civil Rights Act 601 states, "no person in the United States shall on the grounds of race, color or national origin be excluded from participation in, be denied the benefits of, or be subjected to discrimination under any program or activity receiving federal financial assistance.” (U.S.C. 1994) Title VI, Civil rights Act 602 requires "agencies that disperse federal funds to promulgate regulations implementing Title VI Civil rights Act and to create an enforcement framework that details the manner in which discrimination claims will be processed" (Shanahan, 403-406).

In addition to the two foregoing Acts, environmental justice advocates also use 42 U.S.C. 1983 in order to establish that the effect of the agencies’ decision will have a negative impact on the community.  42 U.S.C. 1983 states:

Every person who, under color of any statute, ordinance, regulation, custom, or usage, of any State or Territory or the District of Columbia, subjects, or causes to be subjected, any citizen of the United States or other person within the jurisdiction thereof to the deprivation of any rights, privileges, or immunities secured by the Constitution and laws, shall be liable to the party injured in an action at law (U.S.C. 1983).

These pieces of legislation were beneficial to the environmental justice movement until 2001 when the Supreme Court, in Alexander v. Sandoval held that “602 does not provide an implied private right of action to enforce disparate impact regulations promoted by federal agencies pursuant to 602.”

8. References and Further Reading

a. Books

  • Bullard Robert, Dumping in Dixie: Race, Class, and Environmental Quality. Westview Press, 2000. (cited as DD)
  • Bullard, Robert, Confronting Environmental Racism: Voices from the Grassroots. South End Press, 1993. (cited as CER)
  • Bryant, Bunyan, ed. Environmental Justice: Issues, Problems, and Solutions. Island Press, 1995. (cited as EJ)
  • Camacho, David E. Environmental Injustices, Political Struggles: Race, Class, and the Environment. Duke University Press, 1988.  (cited as EIPS)
  • Rawls, John, Theory of Justice 2nd Edition Oxford University Press, 1999. (cited as TJ)
  • Rawls, Justice as Fairness: A Re-statement. Belknap Press, 2001. (cited as JF)

b. Journals

  • Environmental Justice: An Interview with Robert Bullard, Earth First Journal, July 1999. (cited as Interview)
  • Drummond, Celia Deane, “Environmental Justice and the Economy: A Christian Theologians Views” Ecotheology 11.3 2006: 24-34 (Deane Drummond)
  • Lee, Charles, “environmental justice: Building a Unified Vision of Health and the Environment” Environmental Health Perspectives 10, Supplement 2 (April 2002), 141-144.
  • Rasmussen, Larry, “Environmental Racism and environmental justice: Moral Theory in the Making? Journal of the Society of Christian Ethics 24 1 (2004): 11-28. (cited as Rasmussen)
  • Shanahan, Alice M. “Permitting Justice: EPA’s Revised Guidance for Investigating Title VI Administrative Complaints. ENVTL. LAWYER 403, 406 (Feb. 2001) (citing the Civil Rights Act of 1964, §602, 78 Stat. at 252-253). (cited as Shanahan)

c. Governmental and Legal Publications

  • 42 U.S.C. § 1983 (2002). (cited as U.S.C. 1983)
  • 42 U.S.C. § 2000 (d) (1994). (cited as U.S.C. 1994)
  • Alexander v. Sandoval 532 U.S. 275 (cited as Alexander)

Author Information

Eddy F. Carder
Prairie View A & M University
U. S. A.

The Golden Rule

The most familiar version of the Golden Rule says, “Do unto others as you would have them do unto you.”  Moral philosophy has barely taken notice of the golden rule in its own terms despite the rule’s prominence in commonsense ethics. This article approaches the rule, therefore, through the rubric of building its philosophy, or clearing a path for such construction. The approach reworks common belief rather than elaborating an abstracted conception of the rule’s logic. Working “bottom-up” in this way builds on social experience with the rule and allows us to clear up its long-standing misinterpretations. With those misconceptions go many of the rule’s criticisms.

The article notes the rule’s highly circumscribed social scope in the cultures of its origin and its role in framing psychological outlooks toward others, not directing behavior. This emphasis eases the rule’s “burdens of obligation,” which are already more manageable than expected in the rule’s primary role, socializing children. The rule is distinguished from highly supererogatory rationales commonly confused with it—loving thy neighbor as thyself, turning the other cheek, and aiding the poor, homeless and afflicted. Like agape or unconditional love, these precepts demand much more altruism of us, and are much more liable to utopianism. The golden rule urges more feasible other-directedness and egalitarianism in our outlook.

A raft of additional rationales is offered to challenge the rule’s reputation as overly idealistic and infeasible in daily life. While highlighting the golden rule’s psychological functions, doubt is cast on the rule’s need for empathy and cognitive role-taking. The rule can be followed through adherence to social reciprocity conventions and their approved norms. These may provide a better guide to its practice than the personal exercise of its empathic perspective. This seems true even in novel situations for which these cultural norms can be extrapolated. Here the golden rule also can function as a procedural standard for judging the moral legitimacy of certain conventions.

Philosophy’s two prominent analyses of the golden rule are credited, along with the prospects for assimilating such a rule of thumb, to a universal principle in general theory. The failures of this generalizing approach are detailed, however, in preserving the rule’s distinct contours. The pivotal role of conceptual reductionism is discussed in mainstream ethical theory, noting that other forms of theorizing are possible and are more fit to rules of thumb. Circumscribed, interpersonal rationales like the golden rule need not be viewed philosophically as simply yet-to-be generalized societal principles. Instead, the golden rule and its related rationales-of-scale may need more piecemeal analyses, perhaps know-how models of theory, integrating algorithms and problem-solving procedures that preserve the specialized roles and scope. Neither mainstream explanatory theory, hybrid theory, nor applied ethics currently focuses on such modeling. Consequently, the faults in golden-rule thinking, as represented in general principles, may say less about inherent flaws in the rule’s logic than about shortfalls in theory building.

Finally, a radically different perspective is posed, depicting the golden rule as a description, not prescription, that portrays the symptoms of certain epiphanies and personal transformations observed in spiritual experience.

Table of Contents

  1. Common Observations and Tradition
  2. What Achilles Heel?
  3. Sibling Rules and Associated Principles
  4. Golden Role-Taking and Empathy
  5. The Rule of Love: Agape and Unconditionality
  6. Philosophical Slight
  7. Sticking Points
  8. Ethical Reductionism
  9. Ill-Fitting Theory (Over-Generalizing Rules of Thumb)
  10. Know-How Theory (And Medium-Sized Rationales)
  11. Regressive Default (Is Ancient Wisdom Out-Dated?)
  12. When is a Rule Not a Rule, but a Description?
  13. References and Further Reading

1. Common Observations and Tradition

“Do unto others as you would have them do unto you.”  This seems the most familiar version of the golden rule, highlighting its helpful and proactive gold standard. Its corollary, the so-called “silver rule,” focuses on restraint and non-harm: “do nothing to others you would not have done to you.” There is a certain legalism in the way the “do not” corollary follows its proactive “do unto” partner, in both Western and Eastern scriptural traditions. The rule’s benevolent spirit seems protected here from being used to mask unsavory intents and projects that could be hidden beneath. (It is sobering to encounter the same positive-negative distinction, so recently introduced to handle modern moral dilemmas like abortion, thriving in 500 B.C.E.)

The golden rule is closely associated with Christian ethics though its origins go further back and graces Asian culture as well. Normally we interpret the golden rule as telling us how to act. But in practice its greater role may be psychological, alerting us to everyday self-absorption, and the failure to consider our impacts on others. The rule reminds us also that we are peers to others who deserve comparable consideration. It suggests a general orientation toward others, an outlook for seeing our relations with them. At the least, we should not impact others negatively, treating their interests as secondary.

This is a strongly egalitarian message. When first conveyed, in the inegalitarian social settings of ancient Hebrews, it could have been a very radical message. But it likely was not, since it appears in scripture as an obscure bit of advice among scores of rules with greater point and stricture, given far more emphasis. Most likely the rule also assumed existing peer-conventions for interacting with clan-members, neighbors, co-workers, friends and siblings. In context, the rule affirmed a sentiment like “We’re all Jews here,” or “all of sect Y.” Only when this rule was made a centerpiece of social interaction (by Jesus or Yeshua, and fellow John-the-Baptist disciples) did it become a more radical message, crossing class, clan and tribal boundaries within Judaism. Of special note is the rule’s application to outcasts and those below one’s station—the poor, lepers, Samaritans, and certain heathens (goyem). Yeshua apparently made the rule second in importance only to the First Commandment of “the Father” (Hashem). This was to love God committedly, then love thy neighbor as thyself, which raised the rule’s status greatly. It brought social inclusivity to center stage, thus shifting the focus of Jewish ethics generally. Yet the “love thy neighbor” maxim far exceeds the golden rule in its moral expectations. It stresses loving identification with others while the golden rule merely advises equal treatment.

Only when the golden rule was applied across various cultures did it become a truly revolutionary message. Its “good news,” spread by evangelists like Paul (Saul of Tarsus), fermented a consciousness-shift among early Christians, causing them actually to “love all of God’s children” equally, extending to the sharing of all goods and the acceptance of women as equals. Perhaps this was because such love and sharing radically departed from Jewish tradition and was soon replaced with standard patriarchy and private property. The rule’s socialism might have fermented social upheaval in occupied Roman territories had it actually been practiced on a significant scale, which may help explain its persecution in that empire. Most likely the golden rule was not meant for such universalism, however, and cannot feasibly function on broad scales.

The Confucian version of the golden rule faced a more rigid Chinese clan system, outdoing the Hebrews in social-class distinctions and the sense that many lives are worthless. More, Confucius himself made the golden rule an unrivaled centerpiece of his philosophy of life (The Analects, 1962). The rule, Kung-shu, came full-blown from the very lips and writings of the “morality giver” and in seemingly universal form. It played a role comparable to God’s will, in religious views, to which the concept of “heaven” or “fate” was a distant second. And Confucius explicitly depicted the “shu” component as human-heartedness, akin to compassion. Confucian followers succeeding Mencius into the neo-Confucians, however, emphasized the Kung component or ritual righteousness. They increasingly interpreted the rule within the existing network of Chinese social conventions. It was a source of cultural status quoism—to each social station, its proper portion. Eventually, what came to be called the Rule of the Measuring Square was associated with up to a thousand ritual directives for daily life encompassing etiquette, propriety and politeness within the array of traditional relationships and their strict role-obligations.  The social status quo in Confucian China was anything but compassionate, especially in the broader community and political arenas of life.

In traditional culture, the “others” in “do unto others” was interpreted as “relevant others,” which made the rule much easier to follow, if far less egalitarian or inspiring. One’s true peers were identified only within one’s class, gender, or occupation, as well as one’s extended family members. Generalizing peer relations more broadly was unthinkable, apparently, and was therefore not read into the rule’s intent. Confucius spoke of hopelessly searching in vain, his whole life for one person who could practice Kung-shu for one single day. But clearly he meant one “man,” not person, and one “gentleman” of the highest class. This classism was a source of conflict between Confucianism and Taoism, where the lowest of the low were often depicted as spiritual exemplars.

For the golden rule to have become so pervasive across historical epochs and cultures suggests a growing suspicion of class and ethnic distinctions—challenging ethnocentrism. This trend dovetails nicely with the rule’s challenge to egocentrism at the personal level.  The rule’s strong and explicit egalitarianism has the same limited capture today as it did originally, confined to distinctly religious and closed communities of very limited scope. It is unclear that devout, modern-day Jews or Christians vaunt strong equality of treatment even as an ideal to strive toward. We may speak of social outcasts in our society as comrades, and recognize members of “strange” cultures and unfriendly nations as “fellow children of God.” But we rarely place them on a par with those closer by or close to us, nor treat them especially well. Neither is it clear, to some, that doing so would be best. Instead, the rule’s original small scope and design is preserved, limited to primary groups at most.

Biblical scholars tend to see Yeshua’s message as meant for Jews per se, extending to the treatment of non-Jews yes, but as Jews should treat them. And this does not include treating them as Jews. The golden rule has a very different meaning when it is a circumscribed, in-group prescription. In this form, its application is guided by hosts of assumptions, expectations, traditions, and religious obligations, recognized like-mindedly by “the tribe.” This helps solve the ambiguity problem of how to apply the rule within different roles: parents dealing with children, supervisors with rank-and-file employees, and the like.

2. What Achilles Heel?

When considering a prominent view late in its history, its paths of development also merit analysis. How were its uses broadened or updated over time, to fit modern contexts? Arguably the Paulist extension of the rule to heathens was such a development, as was the rule’s secularization. The rule’s philosophical recasting as a universal principle qualifies most within moral theory. Just as important are ways the rule has been misconstrued and misappropriated, veering from its design function.

We must acknowledge that the golden rule is no longer taken seriously in practice or even aspiration, but merely paid lip service. The same feature that makes the golden rule gleam—its idealism—has dimmed its prospects for influence. The rule is simply too idealistic; that is its established reputation. Note that over-idealism has not discredited Kantian or Utilitarian principles, by contrast, because general theory poses conceptual objects, idealized by nature. They focus on explanation in principle, not application in the concrete. But the golden rule is to be followed, and following the golden rule requires a saintly, unselfish disposition to operate, with a utopian world to operate in. This is common belief. Cloistered monasteries and spiritual communes (Bruderhofs, Koinonia) are its hold-out domains. But even as an ideal in everyday life, the rule is confined to preaching, teaching, and window dressing.  Why then make it the object of serious analysis? The following considerations challenge the rule’s blanket dismissal in practice.

First, the silver component of the golden rule merely bids that we do no harm by mistreating others—treating them the way we would not wish to be treated. There is a general moral consensus in any society on what constitutes harms and mistreatments, wrongs and injustices. So to obey this component of the golden rule is something we typically expect of each other, even without explicitly consulting a hallowed precept. Adhering specifically to the golden rule’s guidelines, then, raises no special difficulty. Its silver role is mostly educative in this context, helping us understand why we expect certain behavior from each other. “See how it feels” when folk violate expectations?

The gold in the rule asks more from us, treating people in fair, beneficial, even helpful ways. As some have it, we are to be loving toward others, even when others do not reciprocate, or in fact mistreat us.  This would be asking much. But despite appearance, the golden rule does not ask it of us. Nothing about love or generosity is mentioned in the rule, nor implied, much less letting oneself be taken advantage of.  Loving thy neighbor as oneself, or turning the other cheek, are distinct precepts—distinct from the golden rule and from each other. These rules are not stated or identified with the golden rationale in biblical or Confucian scripture. Nor are they illustrated together, say in the parables.

We may wish we loved everyone and that everyone loved us, but a wish is not a prescription or command—“Do unto.” And we cannot feasibly love on demand, either in our hearts or actions. (Can we learn to love others as ourselves over a lifetime?) But we can certainly consider how we need or prefer to be treated. And we can treat others that way on almost all occasions, on the spot, without needing to undergo a prior regimen of prayer, meditation, or working with the poor.

As noted, the golden rule may deal more with being other-directed and sensitive rather than proactive. Leading with the word “Do” does not necessarily signal the rule’s demand for action anymore than parents saying to teenagers, “Be good,” when they go on a date. Whether they are (should be) a certain way isn’t the point. There is no need for them to engage their character and its traits, for example. The focus here is on what they do, actually, and should not do. Likewise with “Do your part” or “Don’t get in the way”: these are general directives of how to orient ourselves on certain occasions. They prime us to take certain sorts of postures, showing a readiness to cooperate or to ask others if we are being a pest, though we may not succeed even if we try. They prime us to apologize if in fact we do get in the way, but maybe not more than that.

No altruism (self-sacrifice) is needed for golden-ruling in this psychological form for adopting a certain “other-orientation” in “the spirit of” greater awareness toward others. Usually one bears no cost to engage empathetic feelings, if that is what is needed. One wonders whether an implicit sense of this merely attitudinal “spirit” of the golden rule helps account for why we do not practice it—no hypocrisy required. If so, it would allow an uplifting turnaround in our moral self-understanding and self-criticism.

Conjuring up certain outlooks or orientations is an especially feasible task when provided a golden recipe for how—by role-taking, for example, or empathy or adherence to reciprocity norms. Once our heart goes out to others, following its spontaneous pull hardly requires going the extra foot, much less a mile in effort for anyone. We simply do what we feel, as much as the pull tugs us to. The truth is that we interact largely in words, and kindly words are free. We’re often not occupied when called upon to respond to others, so that responding lushly is easy—there is no hefty competition for our time or interest. Consider the sort of “do-unto” that can make a person’s week: “I wanted to mention how much I appreciate your support during this transition time for me. It’s noticeable, and it means a lot.”

It pays moral philosophy to think the golden rule through in such actual everyday circumstances before imagining the rule’s costs in principle, or worst-case scenarios. Where school systems routinely include some degree of moral education in their curricula, the case for golden-rule feasibility in a society is even stronger. And, arguably, most children already get some such training in school and at home implicitly.

The same reduced-effort scenario holds when sizing up moral exemplarism, often associated with the golden-rule, and with living its sibling principles. Ministering to the poor and ill often involves the routine work of truckers or dock workers, loading canned food or medical supplies to be hauled away, or hauling it oneself. It may involve primitive nursing or cooking, and point of contact service work routinely taken on as jobs by non-exemplars. These are not seen as careers in saintly heroism. Pursuing such work as a mission, not an occupation, takes significant commitment and gumption. But many exemplars report gradually falling into their roles, without really noticing or thinking clearly (David Fattah of Umoja House) or of being dragged into “the life” by others (Andrie Sakharov and Martin Luther King, for example.) (See Colby and Damon 1984, Oliner and Oliner 1988, The Noetics Institute “Creative Altruist” Profiles).  More, everyday exemplars report doing their work out of an atypical outlook on society and their relation to it. This comes spontaneously to them, as ours comes to us. No additional, much less extraordinary effort is required. This seems the point of Mother Teresa’s refrain to those asking how she could possibly work with lepers and the dying, “Come see.”

If the golden rule is designed for small-group interaction, where face-to face relations dominate, a failure to reciprocate in kind will be noticed. It cannot be hidden as in anonymous, institutionally-mediated cooperation at a distance. Subtle pressures will be felt to conform with this group norm, and subtle sanctions will apply to those who take more than they give. Conforming to norms in this setting will be easier than usual, as well, since in-groups attract the like-minded. And in such contexts requiring extraordinarily helpful motivations and actions from others would be seen as unfair.

By assessing the golden rule outside of such contexts we miss its implicit components, the network of mutual understandings, and established community practices that make its adherence feasible and comprehensible. Such considerations are also crucial in determining the adequacy of the golden rule. The shortfalls that have been identified by the rule’s detractors seemingly arise when the rule is over-generalized and set to tasks beyond its design. If its function is primarily psychological, its conceptual or theoretical faults are not key. If its design is small-scale, fit to primary relations, its danger of allowing adherents to be stepped on is not key. The rule should not be used where those around you let them happen or can’t see it happen. And if the rule’s guidance is judged too vague to follow reliably, we should look to the myriad expectations and implicit assumptions that go with it to see if they supply needed precision and clarity.

The golden rule is not only a distinct rationale within a family of related rationales. It is a general marker, the one explicit component in networks of more implicit rationales and specific prescriptions. Teachings that abstract the rule from its implicit corollaries and situational expectations fail to capture what the rule even says. Theoretical models of the rule that further abstract the rule’s logic from its substance, content or process, likely mutilate it beyond recognition.

“How would you feel if?” puts the golden rule’s peer spirit in a mother’s teaching hands when urging her egocentric, but sensitive child to consider others. As a socializing device, the rule helps us identify our roles within mutually respectful and cooperating community.  How well it accomplishes this socializing task is another crucial mark of its adequacy, perhaps the most crucial. The prospect of first engaging this rule typically captures childhood imaginations, like acquiring many highly useful social skills. (Fowler 1981, Kohlberg 1968, 1982)

Putting these considerations together allows us to identify where the golden rule may be operating unnoticed as a matter of routine—in families, friendships, classrooms and neighborhoods, and in hosts of informal organizations aiming to perform services in the community. Isn’t it in fact typical in these interactions that we treat each other reciprocally, as each other would wish, want, choose, consent or prefer?

3. Sibling Rules and Associated Principles

The foregoing appeals for feasibility are not primarily defenses of the golden rule against criticism. They are clarifications of the rule that expose misconceptions, central to its long-standing reputation. We now question, also, the much admired roles of empathy and role-taking in the golden rule, which can ease adherence to it, but are not necessary. The rule is certainly not a guideline for empathizing or role-taking process, as most believe and welcome. However, empathy can help apply the rule and the rule can provide many “teaching moments” for promoting and practicing empathy, which is advantageous. But distinguishing empathy from the rule’s function also is fortunate for the empathetically challenged among us, and those not able to see the others’ sides. Their numbers seem legion. The golden rule can be adhered to in other ways.

The golden rule is much-reputed for being the most culturally universal ethical tenet in human history. This suggests a golden link to human nature and its inherent aspirations. It recommends the rule as a unique standard for international understanding and cooperation—noble aims, much-lauded by supporters. In support of the link, golden logic and paraphrasing has been cited in tribal and industrialized societies across the globe, from time immemorial to the present. This supposedly renders the rule immune to cultural imperialism when made standard for human rights, international law, and the spreading of western democracy and education—a prospect many welcome, while others fear it. Note that if the golden rule is truly distinct from the related principles such as loving thy neighbor as thyself and feeding the poor, these cherished claims for the rule are basically debunked.

Analysis of this endless stream of sightings shows no more than a family resemblance among distinct rationales (See golden rule website in references below.). Some rationales deal with putting oneself in another’s place, with others viewing everyone as part of one human family, or divine family. Still others promote charity, forgiveness and love for all. Culturally, the golden rule rationale is mostly confined to certain strands of the Judeo-Christian and Chinese traditions, which are broad and lasting, at least until recently, but hardly universal (See Wattles 1966).

The golden-rule’s distinctness, here, is seen relative to its origins. The original statement of the golden rule, in the Hebrew Torah, shows a rule, not an ethical principle, much less the sort of universal principle philosophers make of it. It is one of the simpler and most briefly stated dos and don’ts among long lists of particular rules in Leviticus (XIX: 10-18). These directives concern kosher eating, animal sacrifice procedures, threads that can’t be used together in weaved clothing, and even the cleansing of “impurity” (such as menstruation) by bringing pigeons and doves to a rabbi for ceremonial disposition. If one blinks, or one’s mind wanders, one would miss it, its golden gleam notwithstanding. And even a devout Jew is likely to lose concentration when perusing these outdated, dubious and less than riveting observations.

No fair reading of Levitticus XIX: 18 would term its statement the golden rule, not in our modern sense, first stated in Matthew 7:12. For in Levitticus the commandment is merely not to judge an offender by his offense, and thereby hold a grudge against a fellow Jew for committing it. But love him as yourself. The latter, a crucially different principle, is meant here differently than we now interpret it as well. It perhaps can be rendered as `Remember that you offend fellow Jews also and so you are like the offender on other occasions.’

Seen amid such concrete and mutually understood practices of a small tribe, the golden rule poses no role-taking test. Any community member can comply simply by knowing which reciprocity practices are approved or frowned on. Recollecting what it was like to be on the receiving end of others’ slights or benefits also can help. But that would mean taking one’s own perspective, not another’s, in the past. Doing so is not essential to “golden-ruling” however, nor likely reliable. If a kind of imaginative role-playing is contemplated, one need only conjure up images of community elders frowning or fawning over a variety of choice options and everyday practices.

Neither in eastern nor western traditions did the golden rule shine alone. Thus viewing and analyzing it in isolation misses the point. The golden rule’s relation to sibling principles, associated altered its meaning and purpose in different settings. The most prominent standard bearer for this family of rules seems to have been, “loving thy neighbor as thyself.” This “royal law” is a very different sort of prescription from the golden rule, foreseeing a variety of extraordinarily benevolent practices born of extraordinary identification with others. In Judaism, benevolence usually meant helping family members and neighbors primarily, focusing on one’s kind—one’s particular sect. Generosity meant hospitality to the stranger or alien as well, remembering that the Jews were once strangers in a strange land. Alms were given to the poor; crops were not gleaned from the edges of one’s farm-field so that the poor might find sustenance in the remains. Farmland was to lay fallow each seventh year (like the Sabbath when God rested) so that, in part, the poor then could find rest there, and room to grow (Deuteronomy XV: 7, Leviticus XXIII: 22, XXV: 25, 35).

Turning the other cheek (Luke 6:29), loving even one’s enemy (Matthew 5:44) and not turning away when anyone asks of you (5:42)—these go well beyond normal charity or benevolence, even more than identifying with our neighbor. What neighbor would strike or steal from you (taking our cloak so that you must give him your coat also (Matthew 5:40)? Such practices are not at all required or asked of the Confucian “gentleman” whose Kung-shu practice is more about respect for elders and ancestors, and fulfilling hosts of family and community responsibilities.

With regard to Yeshua’s teachings on feeding the hungry, sheltering the homeless, or praying for those who shamefully use and abuse you, he summarily urged that followers “be perfect, even as your Father in Heaven is Perfect” (5:48). This far exceeds what the golden rule asks—simply that we consider others as comparable to us and consider our comparable impacts on them. These do not represent fair or equal reciprocity in fact. Ask how you would wish to be treated if you were a shameful abuser or even homeless person. There is sufficient testimony revealing that many abusers and homeless do not at all want to be shown charity, for example, but condemnation or punishment, in the first case, and being left alone to fend in a “street community” in the second. They feel this is what they deserve. (To abuse-counselors and homeless shelter workers, this goes without saying.) What the abusive and homeless should want, or calculate as their desert, may be something different. But golden-rule role-taking will not tell.

There is one area where the golden rule extends too far, directly into the path of a turning of the other cheek. When we are seriously taken advantage of or mistreated, the rule bids that we treat them well nonetheless. We are to react to unfair treatment as if it were fair treatment, ignoring the moral difference. Critics jump on this problem, as they should, because the golden rule seems designed to highlight such cases. Here is where the rule most contrasts with our typical, pre-moral reaction, while also rising above (Old Testament) justice. In the process, it promotes systematic and egregious self-victimization in the name of self-sacrifice. Yet, is self-sacrifice in the name of unfairness to be admired? Benevolence that suborns injustice, rather than adding ideals to it, seems morally questionable. Moreover, under the golden rule, both victimization and self-victimization seems endless, promoting further abuse in those who have a propensity for it. No matter how much someone takes advantage of us, we are to keep treating them well.   Here the golden rule seems simply unresponsive. Its call to virtuous self-expression is fine, as is its reaction to the equal personhood of the offender. But it neither addresses the wrong being committed, nor that part of the perpetrator to be faulted and held accountable. Interpersonally, the rule calls for a bizarre response, an almost obtuse or incomprehensible one. While a “forgiving” response may be preferable to retribution, why should just desert be completely ignored? It can certainly be integrated into the high-road alternative. In this type of case, the golden rule sides with its infeasible siblings. It bids us to play the exemplar of “new covenant” morality—the morality of love for all people as people, or as children of God. And this asks too much.

These criticisms have merit, but can be mitigated. When dealing with cases of unfairness and abuse, critics assume the golden rule requires us to “take the pain” uncomplainingly. There is no such proviso in the rule. As the Gandhi-King method has shown, it is perfectly legitimate to fault the action—even condemn the action—while not condemning the person, or taking revenge. The practice of abusing or taking advantage of someone does not define its author as a person after all, even when it is habitual. The wrongs anyone commits do not eradicate his good deeds, nor our potential for reform. And the golden rule has us recognize that. But the spirit of silent self-sacrifice is found more in the sibling principles than the golden rule, and should be kept there. In the current case we can readily respond to our oppressor by calling a spade a spade—“You took advantage of me, I noticed.” That would be a first response. “You keep taking advantage of me: that was abusive. I don’t like it; it’s not OK with me.” The abuser responds, “It seems like you like it. Why else would you take it and respond as if it’s OK?” We reply, “Why should I let your abuse drag me down to your level, compounding your offence?”

There are nice and not so nice ways to make this point. If Yeshua is our guide, not so nice approaches are acceptable. To treatment from those known as most righteous in Jerusalem, for example, he responded, “Woe to you Scribes and Pharisees, hypocrites are like whited sepulchers, all clean and fair without, and inside filled with dead man’s bones and all corruption...yours is a house of desolation, the home of the lizard and the spider…Serpents, brood of vipers, how can any of you escape damnation?” (Matthew 23:13-50 as insightfully condensed by Zefferelli.) If this be love, then it is certainly hard love, especially when we note that Yeshua faults the person here, not just the act.

We must also see these cases in social context to see how far the golden rule bids us go. If we are sensible, and have friends, it is unlikely we will place ourselves in the vicinity of serious abusers, or remain there. The social convention of avoiding those who hurt us also must figure into the rule’s understanding. The defense our friends will put up for us against abuse must figure into the rule’s feasibility as well.

Most morally important, these abuse cases do not illustrate the golden rule’s standard application—quite the contrary. Fair-dealing with unfairness and abuse, in particular, call  for special principles of rectification, including punishment, recompense or reform. When used in this context, without alteration, the golden rule poses an alternative to the typical ways these practices are performed. But it remains this sort of special principle. Among its aims, the rule certainly seems bent on goals like rectification, recompense and reform, but indirectly.  Arguably the rule has us exemplify the right path—the path the perpetrator might have taken, but did not, thus demonstrating its allure, its superiority. This includes, for observers in the community, the superiority of fairness over retribution (“’Vengeance is mine,’ sayeth the Lord.”)  Teaching this lesson is aimed at raising moral consciousness, especially in the perpetrator. As such, it resembles the practice of “bearing unmerited suffering” in the Gandhi-King approach, aimed at piquing moral conscience in those oppressing us (King 1986).

Ideally, a perpetrator will think better of his practice, apologizing for past wrongs and making up for them. At least it might move him to abandon this sort of practice. And if moral processes are not awakened, then at least placing the offender in a morally disadvantageous position within the group will bring pressures to bear on his behavior. Exemplifying fairness in this way also shows demonstrates putting the person first, holding his status paramount relative to his actions, and our sense of offense.

Exemplifying a moral high road, so as to edify others does not show passivity or weakness. It is normally communicated in a strong, positive pose. Standing above a vengeful or masochist temptation uplifts the supposed victim, not making him further trodden down.  Indeed, its courageous spirit is key in working its effect, an effect achieved by Gandhi, King and legions of followers under the most morally hostile conditions. Aside from giving abusers pause, high-minded responses bring loud  outcries of protest in one’s cause from outside observers, making reform prudent, and practically necessary.

Again, these realities of the rule can only be seen in context, looking into the subtleties of interpersonal relating, communicated emotion, performance before a social audience and the like. The mere logic or golden principle of the thing is silent on them. The same holds for the less feasible sibling rules of the golden rule family, from giving to the poor to turning the other cheek. Trying them out makes a world of difference in understanding what they say. Consider an experiment with trying to “say yes to all who ask,” and substituting “yes” generally, where we routinely say “no” or “maybe.” Doing so may add much less than expected to our load because, first, it makes us more interested in being kinder, which is a rewarding experience, as it turns out. Second, we find that people do not generally ask much, especially when they see you at risk of being taken advantage of for your exceptional good will. Finding simple ways to make the most needy more self-reliant—such as simply encouraging them to be so—also may lighten the helping load. The good it does may be exceptional.

But what of the lingering “doormat problem” for those who are especially dependent and masochistic, all but inviting victimization from abusers? No full mitigation may be possible here. The golden rule, if not exacerbating the problem in practice, at least serves to legitimatize it. Its rationale has been exploited by many, including some Christian churches and clergy who suborn victimization as a lifestyle, especially for wives and mothers. A rule cannot be responsible for those who misuse it, or fail to grasp its purposes. But those sustaining the rule bear a responsibility to clarify its intent. It certainly would be better if the rule itself made its intentions clear or included illustrations of proper use. Currently, it relies on the chance intervention of moral teachers or service organizations—those opposed to, say, domestic violence.  Even Yeshua’s disciples complained that the parables, supposedly illustrating tenets like the golden rule, were perplexing. Confucian writing was definitely not geared to rank and file Chinese, much less children learning their moral lessons. This is an intolerable shortfall for an egalitarian socialization tool.

Consider a second corollary (the “copper” rule?) that might address such difficulties. “When misused by those do unto fairly, do not quietly bear the offense, instead defending and deflecting if with as much understanding as can be summoned.”  Notice that defending does not conflict with praying for those who shamelessly abuse us. (The “summoning understanding” proviso is meant to forestall reversion to a more pragmatic alternative such as “by any means necessary.”)

4. Golden Role-Taking and Empathy

“Putting oneself in the other guy’s place” is yet another distinct principle, as is “walking a mile in the other guy’s moccasins” (the Navaho version). The first involves taking a perspective, the second, gaining similar life experience in an ongoing way. Notice that “loving thy neighbor as thyself” requires neither of these operations presuming that we know how to love ourselves and need only extend that to someone. But of course we may not know how to love ourselves, or how to do so in the right way. The same can be said with identifying, role-taking or learning from another’s type of experience. Given that we may not be loving enough to ourselves, loving our neighbor is best accomplished by referring to prevailing standards. Our own proclivities or values are certainly not the final word. Just as with acting as we’d have others act toward us, loving thy neighbor concerns how we’re supposed to love others, as we should love ourselves. We must consult the community, its ethical conventions or scriptures (including Kantian or Utilitarian scriptures). The last word comes through a critical comparison of these conventions, in experience, with our proclivities and values.

Neither we nor our neighbors likely think it is legitimate, or even kind, to give a thief additional portions of our property. Doing so might well be masochistic, or even egotistical, thinking about our own character development most, thereby exacerbating crime and endangering the community. If we were the thief, we might very well not think that we should be given more of a victim’s property than we stole. Instead, perhaps, we might wish to steal it. Role-taking cannot guide us here.  In fact, it could easily lead us astray in various misguided directions. Some would consider it ideal to be unconcerned with property because it puts spiritual concerns over materialism, or it puts charity before just desert. Others could make a case for better balancing the competing principles involved. What good does role-taking do here? And how can it work in a non-relativistic way, where everyone taking the other’s role would come to a similar realization of what to do correctly? The golden rule is not meant to raise such questions.

Philosophers deal with these problems by standardizing the way roles are taken, the thinking that goes on in the roles, and so forth. This is what the Kantian veil of ignorance or Rawlsian (1972) original position or Habermasian (1990) ideal speech rubric is for. But surely the commonsense role-taking precepts we are talking about here do not even dream of such measures.

Prescriptions for role-taking are likely prominent in many cultures both for the increased psychological perspective they breed and the door they open to better interpersonal interaction. The interpersonal skill involved is perhaps the best explanation of their widespread use and praise, not their power of edification. It is true that if we truly wished to treat others as ourselves, or the way we would want to be treated—if we were them, not ourselves merely placed in their position—role-taking would help. But it is not unusual for primarily psychological or interpersonal tools to aid ethics without being part of ethics itself.

The golden rule’s (emotional) empathy component is as unclear as its role-taking component. To empathize is not really to take another’s perspective. If we truly took that perspective, we would not have to empathize. Being in that perspective would moot an attempt to “feel with” it from another (Noddings 1984, Hoffman 1987). Even if we took the perspective without the associated emotion, our task would then be to conjure up the emotion in the perspective. It would not be to “feel with” anything. We’d be imaginatively in the other’s  head and heart, imaginatively feeling their feelings directly. More, in any relevant context, the golden rule urges to think before we act, then imagine how we would feel, not how the other would. Thus any empathy involved would involve imaginatively “feeling with” myself, at a future time, recipient of another’s similar action. The point here is to supplant the other’s perspective and imagined reaction with our own. This is not how one empathizes. Emotionally, the appropriate orientation toward causing someone possible harm is worry or foreboding. Toward the prospect of doing future good, it’s anticipation of shared joy, perhaps. “Feeling with” or empathizing with others would be prescribed as, “Do unto others in a way that brings them the likely joy you’d happily share.”

Consider more closely what we are supposed to achieve from role-taking and empathy via the golden rule. We get a sense of how others are different from us, and how their situation differs from ours, uniquely tailored to their perspective and feelings on the matter. We then put ourselves in their place with these differences in tact, added on to ours, and subtracting from ours where necessary. So we occupy their perspective as them, not us, just as we’d wish them to do toward us when acting. (We wouldn’t want them to treat us as they’d wish to be treated, but as we’d wish to be treated when they took our perspective.)

But this already is a consequence of applying the rule, not a way of applying it. If depicted as a rule’s rationale it would say, “Treat others the way they’d wish or choose.” Seemingly the best way to do that is to ask them how they’d like to be treated. If we can’t ask, then perhaps we are not so much doing unto them a way as guessing what they’d like. Putting oneself in their place here would not seem a good idea. Neither would empathy, as opposed to prediction. A good prediction would rest on some track record of what they’ve liked in the past, perhaps acquired from a friend of theirs or one’s own experience with them as a friend.

Without involving others, such role-taking is a unilateral affair, whether well-intended or otherwise. It is often paternalistic, choosing someone’s best interest. The whole process is typically done by oneself, within one’s self-perspective or ego, and it can be spun as one wishes, no checks involved. Fairer and more respectful alternatives would involve not only consulting others on their actual outlooks, but including them in our decision making. “Is it OK with you if….” This approach negotiation is based on a different sort of mutuality, democratizing our choices and actions so that they are multilateral.

5. The Rule of Love: Agape and Unconditionality

To some, the gold in the golden rule is love, the silver component, respect. The love connection is likely made in part by confusing the golden rule with its sibling, love thy neighbor as oneself. Traditionally, ethics could have made the connection semantically—it used the term “self-love” where we now say self-interest. This could render like interest in others as other-love. But this is not really in the spirit of unconditional love.

A more likely path to connecting agape with the golden rule is to consider how we’d ideally wish to be treated by others and most wish we could treat them in turn. Wouldn’t we prefer mutual love to mere respect or toleration? This formulation has appeal though it ignores an important reality. Though we might wish to be treated ideally, we might not wish, or feel able to reciprocate in kind. Keeping mutual expectations a bit less onerous—especially when they apply to strangers and possible enemies—may seem more palatable.

But this is to think in interested and conditional terms. Agapeistic love is disinterested or indifferent, if in a lushly loving way. Its bestowal is not based on anything in particular about the person, but only that they are a person. This sufficiently qualifies them as a beloved. And agape does not come out of us as an interest we have, whether toward people, the good, or anything similar.  It comes only out of love, expressing love, or the good luring us with its goodness. Our staking claim or aim toward the good as a personal goal is not involved. The same is true for self-regard. We love ourselves because we are lovable and valuable, like anyone else. The basic or essential self, the soul within us is lovable whether we happen to like and esteem ourselves or not. (Outka 1972).

The most obvious ethical implication of agape is that it is not socially discriminating. We do not love people because they are attractive, or hold compatible views, or work in a profession we respect.  Are they friend, stranger, or opponent? It doesn’t matter. Most surprising, we do not prefer those close to us or in a special relationship, including parent and child. (Children in agapeistic communities are often raised by the adults as a whole, and in separate quarters from parents, primarily inhabited by peers.)

For moral idealists, agape is most alluring. To love in a non-discriminating way has a certain unblemished perfection to it. Pursuing moral values simply for their value or goodness seems clearly more elevated than pursuing them out of personal preference. Loving someone because they happen to be related to us, or a friend, or could do us a favor is shown up as somewhat cheap and discriminatory by comparison. Seeing ourselves as special is revealed for the trap it is—being stuck with ourselves and our self-preference, a burden to aspiration. What is this condition but the ultimate hold of ego over, binding us to all our attachments? (In philosophy, intellectual ego is a chief obstacle between us and truth, causing us to believe ourselves because we are ourselves, despite knowing that there are thinkers just as wise or wiser, with just as well-seasoned beliefs. Why be led around by the nose of our particular beliefs and interests just because they blare most loudly in our heads?)

Agape is worth pondering as a fit purveyor of the golden rule. What could be more golden? The golden rule’s raison d’être is indeed focused on countering egocentrism and self-interest. But promoting other-directedness is its remedy, not unconditionality. And concern for others’ interests is key to establishing equality as the rule directs. A plausible rendering of the golden rule, making its implicit concern for interests more visible would go, `Treat others the way you would be interested in being treated, making adjustments for their differing interests.’ In these terms, unconditional loving is a bad fit. Are we really “interested” in being treated as anyone should be treated regardless of the interests we identify with, as someone with a soul but no interests worth catering to? Likely not. This same lack of interest haunts Kant’s notion of respecting personhood unconditionally. The golden-rule problem is not that we’re failing to notice others’ personhood, but what others desire or prefer. We could indeed be faulted for ignoring others as persons, treating them like potted plants in the room, but that would only result if they craved our notice, attention, or participation. Typically, it would be fine with others if we just went about our business while not getting into theirs.

To be told that we should not be interested, or to be dealt with by people who will not relate to us in interested terms, basically undermines the golden rule’s effectiveness. As with empathy, we cannot be uninterested on demand, or even after practicing to do so long and hard. And if we do not have our self-identified interests taken seriously, we feel that we are not taken seriously, whether we ideally should or not. Ethics is not only about ideals, nor in fact, primarily about ideals. If interest were not key to ours and theirs, the golden rule would be moot. With unconditional love, reciprocity is beside the point, along with its social reciprocity conventions. Taking any perspective is the same as taking any other. In fact, taking one’s own perspective in particular is discriminatory, even when expressing generosity to others.  So is taking the perspective of any particular other. Happening to be ourselves, or a particular other, and taking that as a basis for favoritism, seems a condition—a failure in unconditionality. I could have been anyone, any of them, as they could have been me. So why do I take who I am or who they are so seriously?. Unlike every other ethic, agape provides no basis for according ourselves special first-person discretion or privacy.  The self-other gap is transcended. It’s not even clear how the typical moral division of labor is justified in agapeistic terms. In principle, when we raise our spoon filled with breakfast cereal at the morning table, the matter of whose mouth it goes into is in question.

Some agapeists would not go this far, instead keeping our self-identification intact. But there is good reason to go farther. Gandhi and King have forwarded a view of loving non-violence that doesn’t even allow self-defense because it involves the preference of self over other. Gandhi characterizes personal integrity as “living life as an open book” since one’s life is not one’s own, but merely one example of everyone’s life. And of course there are the turn the other cheek precepts of Yeshua, which push in this direction.

In any event, ethics is not built for such concerns. It is a system designed to handle conflicts of interest, the direction of interests toward values and, perhaps, the upgrading and transformation of interests into aspirations.  Agape would function, within the golden rule, as something more like a song or affirmation for the self-transformations achieved. It is the very admirable diminution or lack of self-interest, in agapeistic love and in social discrimination that puts an agapeistic golden rule out of reach. Its double dose of moral purity and perfection puts it doubly out of reach. We arguably cannot be perfect as our Father in Heaven is perfect (or complete). We also cannot realistically strive toward it, and most likely should not. Religiously, to do so seems a sacrilege—pretending to the level of understanding, wisdom and “lovability” of infinite godhood. Secularly, its beautiful intentions have unwanted consequences.  Aside from the impersonality of childrearing, anyone who has borne the impersonal treatment or unearnable support from someone bent on “treating everyone the same” can testify to its alienating quality. We wish to be loved for us, for our self-identity and the values we identify with. When we are not loved this way, we do not feel loved at all—not loved for whom we are. Ethically, we expect to be unique, or at least special in others’ eyes when we’ve created a special history. We are entitled to it. We build rights around it. And we feel callously disregarded when a loving gaze shows no special glint of recognition as it surveys us among a group of others. This is less egoism than a sense of distinctness and uniqueness within the additional expectations of realized relationship.

Putting the matter more generally, human motivational systems come individually packaged. They are hard-wired to harboring and pursuing interest. And a valid ethics is designed to serve human nature, even as it strives to improve it. If we can transcend human nature, then we need a different system of values, or perhaps nothing like an ethical system. We have risen beyond good and evil, indifferent to harm of death.. We are born, and remain psychologically individualized throughout life, not possessed of a hive mind in which we directly share our choice-making and experiences. We are each unquestionably possessed of this natural, immutable division of moral labors, which gives us direct and reliable control only of our own self. Hence we are held responsible only for our own actions, expected to do for ourselves, provided special standing to plead our own case of mistreatment, and accorded great discretion in our own individual sphere, to do as we like. When agapeistic morality puts our very nature on the spot, bidding us to recast basic motivations to suit—when it sets us in lifetime struggle against ourselves—it fails to acknowledge morality as our tool, not primarily our taskmaster.  These considerations provide the needed boundary line to situate the golden rule this side of a feasibility-idealism divide. The golden rule is indeed designed for human nature as it is and for egos with interests, trying to be better to each other.

Admittedly the question of agape’s realism may not be decidable given the distinctly spiritual nature of their view. Christian agape, like Buddhist indifference and non-attachment is said to be inexpressible in words. It can only be understood correctly through direct insight and experience. Granted, adherents of these ideals place the achievement of spiritual insight out of common hands. Only a few of the most gifted or fortunate adherents achieve it in a lifetime. As such, spiritual love cannot be the currency of the golden rule as we know it, negotiating mutual equality for the vast majority of humanity in everyday life.

What agapeists may be onto is that the golden rule has a dual nature. At a common level, it is a principle of ethical reciprocity. But for those who use its ethic to rise above good and evil in a mundane sense, the golden rule is a wisdom principle. It marks the transcendence of interested and egoistic perspectives. It points toward its sibling of loving thy neighbor as thyself because thy neighbor is us in some deeper sense, accessible by deeper, less egoistic love.

6. Philosophical Slight.

With the foregoing array of “considered judgments” in hand, we are at last positioned to begin distinct philosophizing on the golden rule. That project starts by consulting philosophy’s reconstitution of traditional commonsense ethics—an added context for golden rule interpretation. Philosophical treatments of the golden rule itself come next, with an evaluation of their alternative top-down approach.

One reason philosophers emphasize the juxtaposition of ethics and human nature stems from the moralistic, if not masochistic cast of ethical traditions. Nietzsche’s depiction of “slave morality” in Christianity is a case in point (Nietzsche 1955). Moral suspicion of medieval shira laws in Islam is another. Because the golden rule is prominent in these suspect traditions, philosophy’s concerns are directly relevant. Self-interest has been rehabilitated in philosophical ethics, along with happiness as satisfying interests, not necessarily matching ethereal ideals or god’s will. Ethics in general has also been feminized to encompass self-caring as well, a kind of third-person empathy and supportive aid to oneself (Gilligan 1982). Here, a clarified golden rule notion can fit well.

The role of ethics as our tool and invention has been promoted over traditional views of its partial “imposition” by Nature, Reason or natural law.  As Aristotelians note, the good for anything depends on its type or species: ethics is for “creatures like us,” and because we are not saintly beings we fall short of by nature. Ironically, this a line preached by Yeshua continually in upholding spirituality, or the heart of “the law,” over the legal letter. “The law (Sabbath) was made for man, not man for the law.” (Mark 2:27-28) On this view, ethics should not fate its users to a life of hypocrisy and of not feeling good enough.

For philosophers, however, even a clarified or unbiased depiction of the golden rule cannot overcome its shortfalls in specificity and decisiveness. Ply the rule in the handling of complex and nuanced problems of complex institutions and it is at sea. We cannot imagine how to begin its application. Exercise it within networks of social roles and practices and the rule seems utterly simplistic. (This said, the irony should not be lost here of critics setting the rule up to fail by over-generalizing its intended scope and standards for success.)

Maximum generalization is the dominant philosophical approach to the rule. And in this form there is no question that its shortfalls are many. The rule seems hopeless for dealing with highly layered institutions working through different hierarchies of status and authority. Yet the rule has been posed by philosophers as the ultimate grounding principle of the major moral-philosophic traditions—of a Kantian-like categorical imperative, and a Utilitarian prototype. It has been claimed, in fact, that the rule’s logic was designed for this generalization across cases, situations, and all varieties of societies (Singer (1963) and Hare (1975)).

These interpretations are highly unlikely judging from the rule’s strikingly ethnic origin and design function, as a bottom-up approach makes clear. As noted, this is a tribal or clan rule, cast in highly traditional societies and nurtured there. There is no evidence that it was ever originally intended to define human obligations and problem solving within the human community writ large, or in complex institutional settings in particular. And so shortfalls found in taking it out of its cultural context—ignoring the range of practices and roles that it presumed, placing it in types of social context that didn’t exist when it was born and raised should be no surprise.  The golden rule’s format invites first-person use, addressing interacting with one or two others. Since the rule’s chief role in society seemingly became the instruction of children, alerting them to impacts on others, its shortfalls in complex problem solving seem irrelevant.  Likewise Kant’s categorical imperative falls short in deciding who does the laundry in a marriage, especially once emotions have become too frayed and raw to import formulae into the discussion.

In small-group interactions what would normally be tolerated as diversity of opinion and practice can be legitimately identified as problematic instead. Being like-minded, most often group members have expressed commitment to common beliefs, values, and responsibilities. But more important, the rule is vastly more detailed and institutionalized here than it seems because of its guidance by established practices, conventions, and understandings. One’s reputation as a group member depends on holding up one’s end of approved norms, including the golden rule, lest one be considered unreliable and untrustworthy. In such contexts, one can imagine a corollary to the golden rule that would make sense: “Show not consideration to him who receiveth without thought of rendering back.” This seems contrary to the golden rule due to our mis-identification of the rule with sibling rationales of forgiveness and unconditional love—letting others abuse and take advantage of us. Moreover, this corollary may not sanction an actual comeuppance of offenders, in violation of golden-rule spirit, functioning instead as a threat or gentle reminder of joint expectations. Such expectations are a commonly accepted part of “doing unto each other” in a neighborhood or co-worker context where conventions of fairness, just desert and doing one’s share go with the territory.

Marcus Singer, in standard philosophical style, portrays the golden rule as a principle, not a rule. This is because it does not direct a specific type of action that can be morally evaluated in itself. Instead, it offers a rationale for generating such rules. Singer is a kind of “father of generalization” in ethics, holding that the rationale for action of any individual in types of situations holds for any other in like situations  (Singer, 1955)    Singer argues further that the golden rule is a procedural principle, directing us through a process—perspective-taking, either real or imaginary, for example—to generate morally salient action directives.

Singer’s is the “ideal” or top-down theoretical approach, as contrasted with our building from common sense. It starts from an abstracted logical ideal, elaborating a theory around it by tracing its logical implications. The approach is notably uninfluenced by the golden rule’s 2,500 year history. Of course, philosophy need not start from the beginning when addressing a concept, nor be confined by an original intent or design or its cultural development.  The argument must be that the rule’s inner logic is the only active ingredient. The rest is chaff or flourish or unnecessary additives.

In principled form, Singer’s golden “rule” serves also as a standard for judging rules and directives for actions that impact us. The rationale of a contemplated action must  adhere to the rubric of a self-other swap to pass ethical muster in the way that, say, our maxim of intentions must pass the universalization test of the Kant’s categorical imperative.

Singer’s view has merit, especially in emphasizing procedure. Still, the distinction between principles and rules may not be as sharp as claimed. General rules (rules of legal evidence, for example) also can be used to derive more specific rules based on their logics; principles need not be consulted. For example: Do nice things; do nice things, anonymously for close neighbors in distress; leave breakfast bakery goods at the doorstep of a next door neighbor the morning after they attend a close relative’s funeral; leave donuts and muffins on your next-door neighbor’s welcome map, rewrapped in a white bag with a sedate silvery bow: leave bagels with chive cheese if they are Jewish, sfagliatelle if they are Italian. The most general rule here, “Do nice things,” targets a type of action that can be morally evaluated as right or wrong, but still needs a procedure for determining specific actions that fall in that category, especially at the borders. Consulting community reciprocity standards or conventions might be one. Thus, do nice things by consulting community standards would proceduralize a rule to generate more specific action directives. Again, no consultation with principles are needed.

A great asset of Singer’s view is its accent on the practical within the prescriptive essence of the rule. Most philosophical principles of ethics are explanatory, providing an ultimate ground for understanding prescriptions. These also can be used to justify moral rationales. But they are prescriptive only in the logical sense of distinguishing “shoulds” from “woulds” or “ares,” not the directive sense—do X in way Y. Singer’s take exposes the how-to or know-how of the golden rule. From here, the rule’s interpersonal role in communication and explanation to others is readily derived, especially during socialization. The rule is not portrayed, then as a stationary intellectual object notched on the wall of an inquiring mind. It takes on a life for the moral community living its life.

R. M. Hare basically places the golden rule in the company of the Kantian and Utilitarian theories, or his own “universal prescriptivism.” That is, he interprets it as a universal grounding principle, a fundamental explanatory principle—for reciprocal respect. This conceives ethical theory on the model of scientific theory, especially a physical theory with its laws of nature. A highlighted purpose of Hare’s account is to bring theoretical clarity and rational backing to what he sees as piecemeal intuitionist and situation-based ethics. These latter approaches typically use examples of ethical judgments that the author considers cogent, leaving the reader to agree or disagree on its intuitive appeal. Yet, Hare renders the crucial “as you would have them do” directive of the golden rule as both what we would “wish” them to do to us (before doing it) and what we are “glad” they did toward us (afterwards). He holds that the golden rule’s logic remains constant, despite these word and tense changes. Notably, no grounding is offered for this claim—for the switch from “would have” to “wish” or “glad,” as if these were obviously the same ideas. Hare apparently feels that they are.

But wishes, choices, preferences, and feelings of gladness certainly do not seem the same thing. Choices can come from wishes, though they rarely do, and one feels glad about the results of choices, if not wishes, generally. Wishing typically has higher goals and lower expectations than wanting; it’s bigger on imagination, weaker on real-world motivation. Choosing is usually endorsing and expressing a want, whether or not it expresses a preference among desired objects. None of these may auger a glad feeling, though one would hope they do, hoping also that one’s choices turn out well and that their consequences please us, which they often, sadly, do not.

7. Sticking Points

The greatest help that the golden rule’s common sense might seek from philosophy is a conceptual analysis of the “as you would have” notion (Matthew 7:12).  This is a tricky phrase. Rendering the rule’s meaning in ways that collapses wish and want obscures important differences, as just noted. An alternative rendering is how you prefer they treat you, singling out the want that has highest priority for you in this peculiar context of mutual reciprocity, not necessarily in general. Further alternatives are treatments we would accept, or acquiesce in or consent to as opposed to actively and ideally choose or choose as most feasible. These are four quite different options. Or would we have others do unto us as we believe or expect they should treat us based on our or their value commitments and sense of entitlement?  Are the expectations of just the two or three people involved to count, or count more than the so-called legitimate expectations of the community? Such interpretations can ride the rule of gold in quite different directions, led by individual tastes, group norms, or transcendent religious or philosophical principles. And we might see some of these as unfair or otherwise illegitimate.

In such contexts, philosophical analysis usually answers questions, clarifying differences in concepts, meanings and their implications. Hare’s account may very likely compound them. I may choose, wish or want that you would treat me with great kindness and generosity, showing me an unselfish plume of altruism. But if I then was legitimately expected to reciprocate out of consistency, I might consent, agree, or acquiesce only in mutual respect or minimal fairness, at most. This is all I’d willingly render to others, certainly, if they did not even render respect and fairness back. From this consent logic we move toward Kantian or social contract versions of mutual respect and a sort of rational expectation that can be widely generalized. But we move very far from the many spirits of the golden rule, wishful and ideal. We move from expanding self-regard other-directedly to hedging our bets, which makes great moral difference.

Similar problems of interpretation rise for the “as” in the related principle, love thy neighbor as thyself (Matthew 20:34).  In ethical philosophy, as noted, “self-love” has been identified traditionally with self-interest or self-preference. In psychology, by contrast, it has been identified with self-esteem and locus of control. These are quite different orientations, setting different generalizable expectations in oneself and in others. It is not clear that generalizing self-love captures appropriate other-love. Common opinion has it that love of others should be more disinterested and charitable than love of self, or self-interest. We feel that it is fine to be hard on ourselves on occasion, but more rarely hard on others. We are our own business, but they are not. They are their own business. It seems morally appropriate to sacrifice our own interests but not those of others even when they are willing. We should not urge or perhaps even ask for such sacrifice, instead taking burdens on ourselves. Joys can be shared, but not burdens quite as much.

We are to be nicer, fairer, and more respectful of others than of ourselves. In fact, ethics is about treating others well, and doing so directly. To treat ourselves ethically is a kind of metaphor since only one person is involved in the exchange, and the exchange can only be indirect. We are not held blameworthy for running our self-esteem down when we think we deserve it, but we are to esteem others even when they have not earned it.

Kant, by contrast, poses equal respect for self and other, with little distinction. We are to treat humanity, whether in ourselves or others, as an end in itself and of infinite value. He also poses second-rung duties to self and other toward the pursuit of happiness—a rational, and so self-expressively autonomous, approach to goods. This might be thought to raise a serious question for altruism—the benefiting of others at our expense. Given duties to self and duties to others, even pertaining to the pursuit of happiness, it is not clear what the grounds would be for preferring others to oneself. Yet one would be honored as generous, the other selfish. And this is so even if we have the perfect right to act autonomously in a generous way, therefore not using ourselves as a mere means to others’ happiness. Throughout his ethical works and essays on religion, however, Kant speaks of philanthropy, kindness, and generosity in praising terms without giving like credit to self-interest.

Some would criticize this penchant for treating others better than ourselves as a Christian bias against self-interest, too often cast as selfishness. But it seems in line with the very purposes of ethics, which is how to interact with others, not oneself. In any case, Yeshua’s conception of love was radically different from the traditional notion of his time as it is from our current common sense.

Most of the population originally introduced to the golden-rule family of rules was uneducated and highly superstitious, even as most may be today. The message greets most of us in childhood. Its Christian trappings growing most, at present, in politically oppressive third-world oligarchies where (sophisticated) education is hard to come by. Likely the rule was designed for such audiences. It was designed to serve them, both as an uplifting inspiration and form of edification, raising their moral consciousness. Yet in these circumstances, the real possibility exists of conceiving the rule as, “if you’re willing to take it (bad treatment) you can blithely dish it out.” Vengeance is also a well-respected principle tied to lex talonis. A related misinterpretation puts us in another’s position with our particular interests in tact, asking ourselves what we in particular would prefer. “If I were you, do you know what I would do in that situation?” Decades of research suggests that these are the interpretations most of us develop spontaneously as we are trying to figure out the golden rule and the place of its rationale in more reasoning over childhood and adolescence (Kohlberg 1982).

We can scoff at the obtuseness of these renderings, but even sophisticates may know less about others’ perspectives than they typically assume. Many have great difficulty imagining strangers’ perspectives from the inside, instead making unwarranted assumptions biased to their own preference. (Selman 1980). Otherwise well-educated and experienced folk can be remarkably unskilled at such perspective-taking tasks. Indeed, feminist psychologists demonstrate this inadequacy empirically in psychological males, especially where it involves empathy or spontaneously “feeling with” others. (Hoffman 1987) (In class, when I’ve fully distinguished empathy from cognitive role-taking, many of my brilliant male students confess, “I don’t think I’ve ever done or experienced that.”) Recent empathy programs designed to stop dangerous bullying in American public schools have acknowledged the absence of empathy in many children. Schools have resorted to bringing babies into the classroom to invoke hopefully deep-seated instincts for emotional identification (or “fellow-feeling”) with other members of our human species (Kohlberg 1969).

How we properly balance empathy with cognitive role-taking is a greater sticking point, plaguing psychological females and feminist authors as much as the rest. (The balance, again, is between feeling with, and imaginatively structuring the person’s conceptual space and point of view.) Such integration problems make it unclear how to follow the golden rules properly in most circumstances. And that is quite a drawback for a moral guideline, if the rule is an action guideline. We might then be advised to seek a different approach such as an interpersonal form of participatory democracy, as was previously noted.

Again, these are precisely the sorts of uncertainties and questions that philosophical analysis and theory is supposed to help answer by moving from common sense to uncommonly good sense. To a certain extent, Kantian and Utilitarian theory does just that, better defining the role of careful thought and estimation (reason), moral personality (the components of “self” and “other” that most count) and how these ground equal consideration. But at some point they move to considerations that serve distinctly theoretical and intellectual purposes, removed from everyday thinking and choice. Kant’s “neumonal self” (composed of reason and free will) and the Bentham-Mill “Util-carrier” (an experience processor for pleasure and pain) are not the selves or others we care about when golden-ruling. Their morally relevant qualities cannot compete in importance with our other personal features. Indeed, we cannot identify with, much less respect these one-sided, disembodied essences enough to overrule the array of motivations and personal qualities that match our sense of moral character and concern.

The theoretical rationality of maximizing good, even with prudence built in, is obviously extremist and over-generalized. Research in more practical-minded economics shows this clearly in coming up with concepts like “satisficing” (seeking enough goods in certain categories of those goods most important to us).  But as philosophers say, the logics of good and reason in Utilitarianism cannot help but extend to maximization—it is simply irrational, all things considered, to pursue less of a good thing when one can acquire more good at little effort. If so, then perhaps all the worse generalization and consistency, which will be avoided by being reasonable and personable. Many of us wish theory to upgrade common sense, not throw it out the window with the golden rationale in tow.

8. Ethical Reductionism

Both present and likely future philosophical accounts may be unhelpful in bringing clarity to the golden rule in its own terms, rather distorting it through overgeneralization. Still, the crafting of general theory in ethics is an important project. It exposes ever deeper and broader logics underlying our common rationales, the golden rule being one. (It is important for some to review these fundamental issues for treating the golden rule philosophically.)

Relative to a commonsense understanding of the golden rule, it is a heady conceptual experience to see this simple rule of thumb universalized--inflated to epic proportions that encompass the entire blueprint for ethical virtue, reasoning, and behavior for humankind. Such is the case with Kantian and Utilitarian super-principles. To increase the complexity of the rule’s implications while retaining its simplicity, transformed to theoretical elegance, is no mean trick. Paul’s revelation that the golden rule is catholic achieved a like headiness in faith. Now to see that faith reinforced by the most rigorous standards of secular reasoning is quite an affirmation. It can also be recruited as a powerful ally in fending off secular criticism.

Often we fail to recognize that extreme reductionism is the centerpiece of the mainstream general theory project. The whole point is to render the seemingly diverse logics of even conflicting moral concepts and phenomena into a single one, or perhaps two. It is very surprising to find how far a rationale can be extended to cover types of cases beyond its seeming ken—to see how much the virtues of golden kindness or respect, for example, can be recast as mere components of a choice process. Character traits, as states of being, appear radically different from processes of deliberation, problem solving, and behavior after all. But the most salient psychological features of virtuous traits fade into the amoral background once the principled source of their moral relevance and legitimacy is redefined. Golden rule compassion becomes virtuous because it allows us to better consider an “other” as a “self,” not necessarily in itself, its expression, or in the good it does.

The project of general theory also exposes how the implications of golden rule’s basic structure fall short when fully extended. Universalization reveals how the basically sound rationale of the golden rule can go unexpectedly awry at full tilt. This shows a hidden chink in its armor. But reducing principles also can overcome the skepticism of those who see the rule as a narrow slogan from the start. The rule can do much more than expected, it turns out, when its far-reaching implications are made explicit. And by exposing the rule’s shortfall and flaws, we can identify the precise sorts of added components or remedies needed to complement it, thus setting back on the right path.

These are the two prime fruits of general theorizing, determining the full extent of a rationale’s reach, before it stretches too thin, and stretching it fully and too thin to expose its failure scenarios. Universalization, in principle, reduces to absurdity in this sense.

Outfitting the golden rule for this project in the standard way, we get “Always act so that you treat any other person, in any context, the way that you would rationally prefer and expressively choose to be treated in that context.” “Never treat someone in a way that would not draw their consent.” (We could say “win” their consent, but that seems a bit “cheerleaderesque.” It invites a process of lobbying that might win or lose due to arbitrary rhetorical skills and which the rule likely does not intend.) Notice that “the standard way” among philosophers is simply to claim that “as you would have” means consent or rational preference without sufficient argument or justification. This is what philosophical research on the matter turns up.

What sorts of faults are revealed by tracing out this principle’s implications? One liability concerns justice. If one puts themselves in the position of someone who has done an injustice, you might reasonably conclude either that the person wishes to be punished, due to their keen sense of justice, or that they wish to be forgiven or to otherwise “get out of” being caught or held accountable. Wishing forgiveness, or at least to be given a second chance, has much to be said for it. And morally, getting one’s just desert also makes sense. A kind of  paradox results, which Christians will recall from the Parable of the Laborers in the vineyard (Matthew 20: 1-16) The rule provides a moral advantage to both punisher and perpetrator in this case. Doing what is fair is good, but using one’s discretion to be forgiving is good also, perhaps better, though not obligatory—a win-win situation. Looking across situations, imagining the social practices and legitimate expectations that result, social members who commit offenses will suffer the luck of the draw. The accountability mechanism of society will not establish a uniform policy of punishment or recompense. (“Luckeee! You got judge X or you mugged a nice guy—wish I had.”)

For moral individualists or libertarians, this is no problem. Who can complain about getting either fair treatment or beneficial treatment? “Should someone be begrudged their generosity,” as the vineyard owner notes, or another their resulting windfall? We accept this discretionary arrangement in many everyday settings. But consider how two children will feel about such unequal treatment, which treats one person as if s/he deserves more, and the other less? Consider how this same sense of being mistreated and perhaps resentful will arise in most small groups of peers. “Why her, not me? Why the favoritism—you value her that much more than me?” The pattern for distributing costs and benefits is unequal to the equal. And that is unjust. Moral liberals will be especially offended by this result. As with many conflicts between moral camps, both sides have a point, which each side seems committed not to acknowledge. And thus far, no way of integrating these rival positions has gained general consensus.

Like any general principle, perhaps, the golden rule also seems incapable of distinguishing general relationships and responsibilities from special ones—responsibilities toward family members, communities of familiars and co-workers, not the wide world of strangers. A proper explanatory principle will allow us to derive such corollaries from its core rationale. But the golden rule falls short: it is truly a rule, not a principle. Compare it with the Utilitarian grounding principle of maximizing good. Maximizing is an ideal logic of reason. Good is an ideal of value of value. We can imagine how a most rational approach to value would promote special situations and relationships, why it would function differently there than in other situations, and why such situations and relationships have special value. Additional good results from family and friendship institutions when members treat each other as special, and especially well. The golden rule, by contrast, bids us to treat people as special when they are not, to treat strangers or enemies as we’d be naturally urged to treat intimates. This is difficult at best, and not clearly a reliable way to maximizing good. It may detract from the good in fact. Also, what is the rationale for treating others as well as those closest to us? Why is showing favoritism toward our favorites a problem? The golden rule itself does not say or explain.

In work situations, are we to ignore who is the boss or supervisor, who is the rank-and-file employee, who is the support staff doing clerical or janitorial work? We’re to be decent to all in some sense, but some we can humanely “order around,” set deadlines for, and some we can’t.

These are serious problems for the golden rule. At a minimum, corollaries would have to be added to the rule explaining how roles and relationships figure in. Treat others as you would choose to be treated in the established social role you each occupy and its legitimate expectations, mother, father, or teacher to children and vice versa, spouses and friends to each other, peer co-workers, supervisor to rank-and-file employees and vice versa, and so forth. Alan Gewirth (1978) has proposed a rule in which we focus on mutual respect for our generic rights alone. This would leave all sorts of other choices to other rationales or to our discretion that the golden rule does not, placing restraints on the rule that it would not currently acknowledge.

Both of these alternatives have horrible consequences for the golden rule however.  Rights simply do not cover enough ethical behavior to rule out forms of psychological cruelty, callousness, and interpersonal exclusion. The reciprocity they guarantee is compatible with most forms of face-to-face interaction that lack it, especially in public peer-relations such as the school or job site, but also in friendships and the family.

Where the ethics or ethos of a society is barbaric, and its hierarchies authoritarian, taking perspectives within roles legitimates these characteristics. How should a slave and her/his master reciprocate? How should a superior race reciprocate with members of a near sub-human race?  This inequality problem is egregious also in adhering to prevailing social reciprocity-conventions applying to roles. Neither ethically skilled role-taking nor empathy can set matters right.

9. Ill-Fitting Theory (Over-Generalizing Rules of Thumb)

Despite its assets, there are further reasons to think that the general theory project is inappropriate for many ethical rationales, the golden rule being perhaps chief among them. Its expose of golden rule faults is more misleading than helpful. General theory assumes that the true and deeper logic of a rationale comes out through generalization, which often is not the case. This should be obvious when theorists note that a rationale cannot avoid certain far-flung implications, no matter how alien or morally outrageous they seem. This “gotcha” view of logical implication speaks badly for logical implication, working alone. Instead of revealing a flaw in the rule’s logic, it may show implicit features of a concept or phenomenon being ignored. In the golden rule’s case this might be a cultural design function being ignored meant purposely to limit the rule’s generalizability and social scope. We must get the rule’s actual “logic” straight, before generalizing it, and this cannot be done in a purely top-down theoretical manner except by creating a different rule.

Rationalist by nature, general theory also assumes that the structure or logic of the rationale is the thing, not its psychological function, emotive effect, or motivational power. The fault here is not emphasizing rational components, but failing to integrate additional components into it adequately. If the golden rule’s logic is procedural, as Singer claims, then it may not serve as a general explanation in “knowing-that” sense, which a Kantian, Utilitarian and “universal prescriptivism” approach like Hare’s ignores. And failing to provide a type of general explanation might not then be a failing.

Besides, the golden rule is unnecessary to the general theoretical project, as Kant (1956)  himself made clear in dismissing it, and in a mere footnote no less ( p. 97, 430:68). We can start with an ideal explanatory principle, ideally structured to capture the explanatory logic of equal consideration or perspective taking. There is no need to generalize from commonsense, distorting a rule designed only for commonsense purposes, in a restricted locale. A reductive account provides an explanation and understanding of one sort, exposing the essential element or active ingredient underlying an ethics’ appearance. It allows us to strip bare what holds the golden rule together beneath surface content that often matters little to its substance. But this account provides neither a good explanation nor understanding of the rule as a whole, or in any element, relative to the rule’s distinct meaning for its users or benefactors, nor its distinctive application in any real-life situation. “I’ve become so focused on getting this project done on time that I’ve lost sight of these people working on it being my colleagues, indeed, my neighbors and friends, of their deserving to be treated that way.”  This is especially true of the implied how-tos or forms of address that make all the difference when showing respect and concern for others. How we do unto our mother or our child or our co-worker, even when their basic personhood is most at stake, requires a remarkably different form of address to convey equal consideration. Patronizing someone (a parent) in showing respect, can convey disrespect. So can failing to “patronize (a child) and thereby coming off cold and remote. These are essential moral matters, golden-rule matters, not just a matter of discretionary style.

Unlike Kant, J. S. Mill (1961) identified the golden rule as “the complete spirit of the ethics of utility” (p. 418). It apparently served as a leading light for the Utilitarian principle, despite the principle’s appearance of not holding high each individual’s sanctity (as a “child of god”).  This may seem outrageous to those who see both the golden rule and Kant’s principle as vaunting this sanctity, whatever their utility to society. For them, Utilitarianism makes an ethic out of the immoral logic of “ends justify the means,” willingly sacrificing the individual to the group—or obligating us to do so. The golden rule, by contrast, asks us to consider another’s equality, not sacrifice her or ourselves for group welfare.

But let us remember that these alleged features of utilitarianism are completely unintended, the result of outfitting its “advance the common good” rationales with universality, then trying to cover all ethical bases, working alone. (Obviously modern democratic constitutions have brought advancing the common good into line with securing individual rights simply by retaining both principles in their own terms and using each to regulate the other.) Even the lush empathy of Utilitarian intent, so key to who sacrifices or willingly serves, was eventually ejected from its general theory. This is an ultimate “golden rule lost” scenario, and reductionism gone wild. Many have noted how “each is to count for one” seems merely inserted into the Utilitarian concept with little utilitarian basis. The golden rule spirit may be one explanation.

The apparent association between the golden rule and the maximizing super-principle came basically from the central role of compassion in early Utilitarian theorizing. When people become experienced with each other, recognizing common needs, hopes and fears, failures and successes, they are moved to act with mutual understanding. This increases their like-mindedness and mutual identification in turn. The resulting sense of connection nurtures increasing indifference toward the narrow desires of those concerned, whether in oneself or others.  Membership in, and contribution to shared community becomes defining. This is how golden rule other-directedness and equality moves toward full mutuality in the pursuit of overall social good. And is there a more “Christian spirit” of charity and service available?

Like most key tenets of ethics, the golden rule shows two major sides: one promoting fairness and individual entitlement, conceived as reciprocity; the other promoting helpfulness and generosity to the end of social welfare. Both the Kantian and Utilitarian traditions focus on only one side, furthering the great distinctions in philosophical ethics—the deontology-teleology and justice-benevolence distinctions. For the general theory project, this one-sidedness is purposeful, a research tool for reductive explanation.

The Utilitarian, Charles Dickens, probably draped most golden-rule content and spirit over the utilitarian side in his Christmas Carol. “Business? Mankind was my business, the common welfare was my business; charity, mercy, forbearance and benevolence were, all, my business. The dealings of my trade were but a drop of water in the comprehensive ocean of my business” (p. 30). In a small way here, Dickens highlighted the direct and visible hand of Utilitarian economics in contrast to the invisible hand of Utilitarian Adam Smith and his capitalist economics—a hand Dickens found quite lacking in compassion or egalitarian benefit. Dickens captured Utilitarianism’s moral hell in even more strikingly golden rule terms, “The air was filled with phantoms, wandering hither and thither in restless haste, moaning as they went…one old ghost cried piteously at being able to assist a wretched woman with an infant, whom it saw below upon a doorstep. The misery with them all was clearly, that they sought to interfere, for good, in human matters, and had lost the power forever” (p. 33). Arguably, the power lost was to treat those in need as one’s potentially needy self should be treated. The each-is-to-count-for-one equality of the golden rule is portrayed as a proven, socially institutionalized means to social good.  “I have always thought of Christmas…as a kind, forgiving charitable and pleasant time when men and women seem, by one consent, to open their shut-up hearts freely and to think of people below them as if they really were fellow-passengers to the grave, not another race of creatures bound on other journeys” (p. 9).What speech more heartily hits the golden tones of the golden rule?

10. Know-How Theory (And Medium-Sized Rationales)

What seems needed to philosophize ably about the golden rule, and its relatives are theoretical models fit for rules of thumb. These would be know-how models, defined by the conceptual work it draped around algorithms, operations, and steps in procedures for putting rules into effect. As noted, these may be psychological rules for taking certain moral points of view, rules of problem solving, negotiation, making contributions to ongoing practices, interactions, and more unilateral actions. These components would be given a context of use and interrelated in crucially different ways, with suggestions for interrelating them further.  Illustrations would be provided of their application and misapplication, at high, medium, and low quality. The resulting combination would be provided overall structure and comprehensibility which would include the rationales needed to explain and justify its components. Rationales for applying the procedures would allow unique and flexible alliances among components fit for particular functions and novel situations. This would encompass the best features of the otherwise inchoate rubric of a conceptual “tool-box.” The illustrations would encompass the best features of philosophically upgraded ethics codes. A range of corollaries would be provided for the rules involved, the golden rule family, for example, capturing the sorts of conventional expectations and practices presumed during the rules’ creation and development. These are of greatest importance to its practicality and success. And, of like importance, background frameworks would be provided for how to practice the rule, indicating the difference in orientation of the novice and expert user. How might we follow a recipe when cooking the way a chef who “knows his way around the kitchen” would?

Relative to mainstream philosophical theory, this project might seem historically regressive, even anti-philosophical.  It resembles a return to the most piecemeal sort of intuitionism, combined with a “hands-on,” applied approach taken to a new clerical extreme. (Applied ethics already boasts hundreds of decision-making step procedures.) For traditional philosophers the small-scale common-sense rationales involved also may seem philosophically uninteresting. “Advancing the good” may be a fine tip for everyday practice but holds little conceptual subtlety compared to “maximizing the ratio of benefits over costs across the domain of sentient beings.” The unseen implications of a maximization principle provided us a new model of practical reason. Resubmitting the range of ethical concepts to it suggests that the aims and consequences of actions, combined with quality of experience, may be all that ethics comes to, personal integrity and inherent rights aside.  Thus the rules of thumb discussed by Mill in his Utilitarianism were quickly deserted by philosophers for rule-utilitarianism. This built newly generalized principles into the very structure of maximization (maximize the regard for rights as inherent and inviolable), turning the pre-existing utilitarian principle (regarding rights and all else as means to social good) into a super-principle, as some term it.

But if one looks back at Mill’s ethical writings as a whole, dropping preconceptions about general theory of utilitarianism itself, one finds ethical rules hat cross categories like deontology and teleology, working insightfully and usefully together, also by rule of thumb, not principle or intuition. There was a time when moral theorist simply dismissed intuitionist and applied theory approaches. Hare does above, Rawls did in his hallowed A Theory of Justice (1972), calling them half-theories. These theories cited piecemeal and ungrounded insights where the completing of conceptual structure was required to provide a full explanatory account. But these forward-looking theorists worked such piecemeal views into pluralist, hybrid, or eclectic theoretical forms. Rawls himself discussed “mixed theories,” with medium-sized principles, which he acknowledged as formidable alternatives to a general theory like his own. (See Rawls’s multiple index references to intuitionism and mixed theories.) The golden rule can find a place here, a merely somewhat generalized, medium-sized or right-sized place, allowing it to function as a lived ethic, readily applicable to everyday life to several ends. There is a certain satisfaction as well to using the most ancient but enduring epigrams of ethics, such as the golden rule, to create the most cutting-edge theoretical forms.

11. Regressive Default (Is Ancient Wisdom Out-Dated?)

Serious innovation in ethics is a long time coming. Arguably, the golden rule has not been seriously updated in its own terms—conceptually, procedurally and culturally since 500 B.C.E., or perhaps 28 C.E., despite quite radical changes in the primary groups of modern societies, and the decrease in tribal societies. Since applied and practical ethics gathered steam, ground-breaking developments like the “ethics of complex organizations” have been few and far between. It is remarkable that moral philosophy is still focused on concepts that were contemporaries of phlogiston and élan and vital, bile and humors. The golden rule long preceded these. Such notions were formulated and plied in an age of rampant superstition, seasoned by deep misconceptions about the nature of reality, human nature (psychology) and social organization. Modern empirical research has had difficulty finding the stable psychological traits that we continue to call virtues. If stable traits exist at all, they may not be organized morally. If they are, their stability and supposed resistance to situational factors of morality appears remarkably weak (Kohlberg 1982a, Myers, chs. 4, 6-9, 12). But philosophers have given hardly a thought to the real prospect that there may be no such things—no real phenomena to cover our grab-bag folk terms. Virtue theorists seem unparsed as they experience a philosophical upswing. Brain research has uncovered forms of mental computation that differ significantly from what we term reasoning or emotion. This should be producing experimental revamping of ethical thinking. Unfortunately, a raft of hasty interpretations of these findings’ significance (by J. Haidt, primarily) have provided grounds for undue skepticism.

The golden rule enjoys the reputation of enduring wisdom, even if its lack of conceptual sophistication leaves philosophers cold. But its ancient origin should make us wonder if it is in fact perennial hot air, misleading even regarding the framework in which moral philosophy is done.

The model of general theory, based on general laws, still enjoys mainstream status in moral philosophy, despite challenges that have diminished its domination. But consider what has happened to its scientific mentor. Important new innovations in physics are questioning the use of general theories marked by laws of nature, gravity, and the like, holding that this centerpiece of physics for centuries was a wrong turn from the beginning that led to the dead end of string theory and an inability to understand quarks and quantum mechanics. Unthinkably regressive anthropomorphic alternatives, such as “biocentric cosmology,” are being taken seriously, or at least stated boldly before a scientific public. (This is the view that reality is determined by our observing it—a giant step beyond the Schrödinger’s Cat Paradox.) In part, this results from challenging the value of sophistication in views like string theory that consider it explanatory to posit non-existent and unknowable scores of reality dimensions for realities we observe. More, these cutting-edge, potentially revolutionary ideas are being proliferated in high-level physics in such popular outlets as Discover Magazine (April 2010 p. 32-44, May p. 52-55) and the Discovery TV Channel, available with “basic cable.”

Where are the parallels in ethics? Where are the steps beyond “subverting the dominant paradigm,” and posing real alternatives for public consumption where ethics meets reality, where the golden rule abides today? Currently, moral philosophy floods its public with an unstoppable stream of “theory and practice” texts championing Kantian deontology and Utilitarian teleology, with the supposedly direct application of their super-principles to concrete cases. (There is nothing like a fundamental explanation to decide an issue and take specific action, is there?) This is especially so when a reader need only follow the philosophical author’s advice to “balance” these two great and conflicting principles in application and practice, as philosophers have been unable to do for centuries. A chapter is always devoted to ancient “virtue ethics” in these volumes despite no one apparently knowing how to apply moral traits or character to anything concrete, in any concrete way.

Before a rule like the golden one is either slighted or acknowledged, moral philosophy should consider innovative approaches to conceiving such rules, their fitness to current practice, and perhaps what we can learn from converting the rule to a programmable algorithm for autonomous agent programming. Perhaps simply “generalization” the rule, as anciently stated is not the most creative theorizing approach. A possible step in a new direction, if originated in more than century-old thinking, is attempted below.

12. When Is a Rule Not a Rule, but a Description?

In classic lectures, compiled as The Varieties of Religious Experience (1901/1985) William James declares the golden rule incompatible with human nature (Lect. 11). It routinely violates the basic structure of human embodiment, the laws of human motivation, and the principles of rational choice of behavior based on them, as depicted above. (James may have confused the rule with sibling principles when making this blanket observation.)

Yet, gathered around this law-like “given,” in James’s remarks are reams of psychological testimony on putative “conversion” and “visitation” experiences wrought by divinities (Lect. 9-12). James identifies certain common features and aftereffects in these putatively supernatural experiences, including ecstatic happiness and sense of liberation, expansive sense of self, and a self-diffusion into those nearby--selflessness of a special, merging sort. He notes, likewise, an overflowing urge to love, give and aid others, nurture and support unlimited others, with unlimited energy, and no sense of sacrifice to oneself. The main attitude observed is “yea-saying” toward everything, reminiscent of Christian calls for “saying yes” to God and “to all who ask of ye” (Lect. 11).This syndrome of experiences and proclivities gives new meaning for its “patients” to what a devoted and dedicated life can be—not devotion to religious duties or divine commands, but the spontaneous embodiment of omnipresent love..

Mystical experience of this sort typically bridges the complete separation between perfect Godhood and sinful devotee, substituting a sense of oneness and “flow” within a cosmic ocean of bliss. James cites ways in which the lasting sensibilities of this experience suborn the asceticism, spiritual purity, and willing material poverty associated with saintliness (Lect. 11).  In a certain way, James goes on to provide a differential diagnosis of this syndrome of symptoms or “golden rule effect.” The cause he infers is some sort of seizure—literally, a seizure—suggesting occult influences, unusual electro-chemical processes within the central nervous system, or both. James notes that when subjected by him to certain “ethers,” known for hallucinogenic effects, those who report these divine visitations also report a strikingly similar experience “under the influence.” All that is missing is a sense of the supernatural. This is not the most morally reassuring depiction of the golden rule as a phenomenon, but so it goes.

Imagine now that there are a third and fourth avenue to these experiences or to the proclivities and golden behaviors that result. One, the third, might involve the secular spiritual transformation that comes from single-mindedness. When someone’s striving for a cherished goal becomes a life-mission, be it mastering a musical instrument or fine art, or putting heart and soul into building a business, or putting a public policy in place (a new drunk-driving ban or universal health care) they often come to embody their goal. “He is his company.” “She has become her music” (“and she writes the songs”).  Certainly in religion this is what is meant by terming someone holy or a living saint. This is also the secular goal of Confucian practice, to make li (behavioral ritual) yi (character). One accomplishes this transformation by complete and intense concentration of thoughts and behavior, and by “letting go” of one’s self-awareness or ego in the task. The work takes over and one becomes “possessed” by it, either in an uplifting way, or as in the need for exorcism, rehab, or at least “intervention” by friends and family. When morality sets the goal and means here, we term their culmination “moral exemplarism.”

This is the indirect pursuit of the golden rule that focuses on ideally good means to ideally good ends. “Love the good with your whole mind, your whole heart and your whole strength,” then you will love your neighbor as yourself, and also treat her as you’d wish to be treated by her. The differential diagnosis here identifies devotion that leads to embodiment as the cause of golden rule effect. And this devotion need not include any following or practicing rules of thumb like the golden rule, purposely fulfilling duties, or practicing those conventional activities associated with being morally upright. It can be as spiritual and abstract an activity as concentrated rational intuition ever-intent on an imagined Platonic form of good, which presumably would direct one’s perception of every reflection of the Form, in every ethical matter one dealt with in life.

Now consider a fourth avenue, much more common to everyday ethics. Here, doing good or being fair is a part-time activity, undertaken alongside hosts of alternatives. It is developed through socialization and reflective practice relative to the normative institutions of society. Social norms are internalized and habituated in action, even to the point of what we call character traits. When dealing with others, and typical moral issues, we gain a sense of proper reciprocity and the need for a certain egalitarianism in how we show respect. In addition, we hear of various rules and principles advising us on how to do this. Among these are members of the golden rule family, perhaps the golden rule itself. One flirts with following those rules of thumb within reach, the way one finds oneself tempted to buy a product one sees advertised. One notices ways that one’s activities already overlap with their biddings. And slowly the rule becomes a partial habit of heart and hand, an implicit directive.

Still, the rule is sometimes consciously referred to as a reminder. Like breathing, that is, the rule has an involuntary and voluntary component in one’s life. Other rules seem reachable somewhere down the road and may slowly become an ideal to work toward, walking a mile in others’ moccasins perhaps,  while an additional class of rules only gets our salute from afar—it is wildly out of reach. “Love your neighbor as yourself” seems in this class, along with, “turn the other cheek” or “give others anything they ask.”

Getting some perspective, the second and third avenues or “ways of embodiment” above are analogous to the two main schools of Zen Buddhism—Rinzai and Soto. In the first, one experiences satori or enlightened awakening in a sudden flash. It is not known how, even a non-devotee may be blessed by this occurrence. One smiles, or laughs as a result, at the contrast in consciousness, then goes back to one’s daily life with no self-awareness of the whole new sense of reality and living it creates. Those around cannot help but notice the whole new range of behaviors that come out, filled with the compassion of a bodhisattva. To the master, it is daily life and interaction: “I eat when I am hungry, I sleep when I am tired.”

The third way is that of gradual enlightenment. One meditates for its own sake, with no special aim in mind—no awaited lightning strike from the blue. “Over time, as one constantly “polishes one’s mirror,” Zen consciousness continually grows until normal consciousness and ego fade out, akin to the Hindu version of enlightenment or moksha. Compassion grows beside it, imperceptibly, until one is bodhisattva. To the recipient, Zen-mind seems ordinary mind.

The fourth way, is more a simulation than a “way.” It is not a form of embodiment at all, and therefore does not generate golden rule effect as a spontaneous offshoot. We learn to act, in some respects, as a master or exemplar would, but without embodying the character being expressed, or being truly self-expressive in our actions. What we call ethics as a whole—the ethics of duties, fulfilling obligations, adhering to responsibilities, and respecting rights can be seen as this sort of partial simulation. We develop moral habits, of course, some of which link together in patterns and proclivities. And we can  “engage” these. But we would not continue to carry around a sense of ethical assembly instructions or recipes needing sometimes to refer to them directly—if we were ethics, if we embodied ethics. We don’t retain rules and instructions when we are friends or parents. (Those who read parenting books are either looking for improvements or fearing that they aren’t true parents yet.) Where else in our daily lives do we look to principles, rules of thumb or formula supplied as advice by a colleague or co-worker to proceed at what we already supposedly can do? When we are a worker, we just work. When we are ethical, we often pause and consult a manual. This is not to deny automaticity or self-reliant reasoning in ethics.

The golden rule displays one algorithm for programming exemplary fair behavior, which can be habituated by repetition and even raised to an art by practice. Virtue ethics (habits) and deliberation ethics (normative ethics) fall here. What we are simulating are side-effects of a moral condition. We are trying to be good, by imitating symptoms of being good.

A behavioral route can be taken instead to these simulations, side-stepping direct reference to the rule. In some ways it is more revealing of our simulation. Here we engage in repetitive behaviors that conform to a reciprocity convention that conforms to the rule. We do not act out of adherence to the rule, but only out or imitation of its applications or illustrations. This again was the Aristotelian approach to learning virtues and also the Confucian approach for starting out. In Japan, this sort of approach extended from the Samurai tea ceremony to the Suzuki method of learning the violin (See Gardner 1993). Such programming is akin to behavioral shaping in behaviorist psychology though it rests primarily on principles of competence motivation, not positive and negative reinforcement.

Social psychology has discovered that the single best way to create or change inner attitudes and motivations is to act as if one already possessed them. Over time, through the psychology of cognitive dissonance reduction, aided by an apparent consistency process in the brain, the mind supplies the motivation needed (Festinger 1957, Van Veen, and others, 2009).  These processes contradict common opinion on how motivations are developed, or at least it does so long as our resolve does. Unless one keeps the behavior going, by whatever means, our psychology will extinguish the behavior for its lack of a motivational correlate.

Here, as elsewhere, the golden rule can act as a conceptual test of whether the group reciprocity conventions of a society are ethically up to snuff. As a means to more morally direct simulation, those interested in the golden rule can try alternative psychological regimens—role-taking is one, empathy might be another. And these can be combined. Those who assume that exemplars must have taken these routes in their socialization may prefer such practices to conventional repetition. However, each is discretionary and but one practical means to it. Each has pros and cons: some routes serve certain personality types or learning styles, others not so well.  In certain cultures, mentoring, mimicking and emulating exemplars will be the way to go.

Deep Thoughts: Perhaps one can also try the way of humor:  “Before you insult a man, walk a mile in his shoes. That way you’ll be a mile away when he gets offended, and you’ll have his shoes.”—John Handy

13. References and Further Reading

  • Allen, C. (1996).   “What’s Wrong with the Golden Rule? Conducting Ethical Research in Cyberspace.” The Information Society, v. 1 no.2: 174-188.
  • Colby, A. and Damon, W. (1984). Some Do Care. New York, NY: Free Press.
  • Colby, A. and Kohlberg, L (1987). The Measurement of Moral Judgment. Vol I, New York: NY: Cambridge University Press.
  • Confucius, (1962). The Analects. New York, NY: Penguin Classics.
  • Cox, J. R. (1993). A Guide to Peer Counseling. New York, NY: Rowan and Littlefield.
  • Dickens, C. (1977). A Christmas Carol. New York, NY: Crown
  • Publishers/Weathervane Books.
  • Firth, Roderick  (1952 ). “Absolutism and the Ideal Observer.” Philosophy and  Phenomenological Research Vol XII #3: 317-345.
  • Festinger, L. (1957). A theory of Cognitive Dissonance. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
  • Fromm, Erich (1956). The Art of Loving. New York: NY: Harper and Row.
  • Fowler, J. (1981). Stages of Faith: The psychology of human development and the quest for meaning. San Francisco, Ca: Harper and Row.
  • Gandhi, M. (1956). All Men Are Brothers. New York: NY, Continuum Press.
  • Gardner, H. (1993). Frames of Mind: The Theory of Multiple Intelligences. New York, NY: Basic Books.
  • Gilligan, Carol. (1982) In A Different Voice. Cambridge, MA:  Harvard University Press.
  • Giraffe Heroes Project,  Box 759, Langley, Washington 98260.
  • Habermas, J. (1990). “Discourse Ethics: Notes on a Program of Philosophical Justification.” In Moral Consciousness and Communicative Action. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Hare, Richard M. (1975). Abortion and the Golden Rule. Philosophy and Public Affairs. Vol. 4 #3 201-222.
  • Hoffman, S. (1987). “The Contribution of Empathy to Justice and Moral Judgment.” In Nancy Eisenberg and J. Strayer, (eds.) Empathy and its Development. (Cambridge Studies in Social and Emotional Development) New York, NY: Cambridge University Press.
  • James, W. (1985).  The Varieties of Religious Experience. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Kant, I. (1956). Groundwork for a Metaphysics of Morals. New York: NY, Harper and Row.
  • King, M. L. (1986). Stride for Freedom. New York: NY: Harper and Row.
  • Kohlberg, L. (1968). The Child as a Moral Philosopher. Psychology Today, 1: 25-32.
  • Kohlberg, L. (1969). “Stage and Sequence: The Cognitive-developmental Approach to Socialization.” In D. A. Goslin (ed.) Handbook of Socialization Theory. Chicago: IL. Rand McNally: 347-480.
  • Kohlberg, Lawrence. (1982). “From Is To Ought.” In The Philosophy of Moral Development.  New York, NY: Harper-Row.
  • Kohlberg, L. (1982a). “Education for Justice: A Modern Statement of the Socratic View.” The Philosophy of Moral Development. New York: NY Harper-Row.
  • Mencius (1993). The Book of Mencius. Trans. Giles. L. Clarendon, VT: Tuttle Publications.
  • Meyers, D. C. (2005). Social Psychology. New York, NY: McGraw-Hill, chapters 4, 6, and 8.
  • Mill, John Stuart. (1861). "Utilitarianism" in The Utilitarians. Garden City, NY: Double Day and Company.
  • Noddings, Nel. (1984). Caring: A Feminine Approach To Ethics. Los Angeles, CA: University of California Press.
  • Noetics Institute: Creative Altruism Program. 101 San Antonio Rd. Petaluma CA94952.
  • Nietzsche, F. (1955). Beyond Good and Evil. Chicago, IL: Gateway Press.
  • Oliner, S., and Oliner, P. (1988). The Altruistic Personality. New York, NY: Free Press.
  • Outka, Gene. (1972). Agape: An ethical Approach. New Haven, CT: Yale University     Press.
  • Rawls, John  (1972). A Theory of Justice. Cambridge, MA, Harvard University Press.
  • Selman, R. (1980). The Growth of Interpersonal Understanding: Developmental and Clinical. New York, NY: Academic Press.
  • Selman, R. (1971). “Taking Another’s Perspective: Role-taking Development in Early Childhood.” Childhood Development. 42, 1721-1734.
  • Singer, M. (1955). “Generalization in Ethics.” Mind, 64 (255): 361-375.
  • Singer, M. (1963).  The Golden Rule. Philosophy Vol. XXXVIII #146: 293-314.
  • Wattles, J. (1966).    The Golden Rule. New York: NY, Oxford University Press.
  • Van Veen, V., Krug, M. K., Schooler, J. W., Carter, C. S. (2009). “Neural Activity Predicts Attitude Change in Cognitive Dissonance.” Nature Neuroscience 12 (11): 1469-1474.
  • Zefferelli, F. (1977). "Jesus of Nazareth" (television mini-series).
  • Zeki, Semir, (2000). “The Neural Basis of Romantic Love.” NeuroReport: 11: 3829-3834.

Author Information

Bill Puka
Rensselaer Polytechnic Institute
U. S. A.

Philosophy of Love

This article examines the nature of love and some of the ethical and political ramifications. For the philosopher, the question “what is love?” generates a host of issues: love is an abstract noun which means for some it is a word unattached to anything real or sensible, that is all; for others, it is a means by which our being – our self and its world – are irrevocably affected once we are ‘touched by love’; some have sought to analyze it, others have preferred to leave it in the realm of the ineffable.

Yet it is undeniable that love plays an enormous and unavoidable role in our several cultures; we find it discussed in song, film, and novels – humorously or seriously; it is a constant theme of maturing life and a vibrant theme for youth. Philosophically, the nature of love has, since the time of the Ancient Greeks, been a mainstay in philosophy, producing theories that range from the materialistic conception of love as purely a physical phenomenon – an animalistic or genetic urge that dictates our behavior – to theories of love as an intensely spiritual affair that in its highest permits us to touch divinity. Historically, in the Western tradition, Plato’s Symposium presents the initiating text, for it provides us with an enormously influential and attractive notion that love is characterized by a series of elevations, in which animalistic desire or base lust is superseded by a more intellectual conception of love which also is surpassed by what may be construed by a theological vision of love that transcends sensual attraction and mutuality. Since then there have been detractors and supporters of Platonic love as well as a host of alternative theories – including that of Plato’s student, Aristotle and his more secular theory of true love reflecting what he described as ‘two bodies and one soul.’

The philosophical treatment of love transcends a variety of sub-disciplines including epistemology, metaphysics, religion, human nature, politics and ethics. Often statements or arguments concerning love, its nature and role in human life for example connect to one or all the central theories of philosophy, and is often compared with, or examined in the context of, the philosophies of sex and gender as well as body and intentionality. The task of a philosophy of love is to present the appropriate issues in a cogent manner, drawing on relevant theories of human nature, desire, ethics, and so on.

Table of Contents

  1. The Nature of Love: Eros, Philia, and Agape
    1. Eros
    2. Philia
    3. Agape
  2. The Nature of Love: Further Conceptual Considerations
  3. The Nature of Love: Romantic Love
  4. The Nature of Love: Physical, Emotional, Spiritual
  5. Love: Ethics and Politics
  6. References and Further Reading

1. The Nature of Love: Eros, Philia, and Agape

The philosophical discussion regarding love logically begins with questions concerning its nature. This implies that love has a "nature," a proposition that some may oppose arguing that love is conceptually irrational, in the sense that it cannot be described in rational or meaningful propositions. For such critics, who are presenting a metaphysical and epistemological argument, love may be an ejection of emotions that defy rational examination; on the other hand, some languages, such as Papuan, do not even admit the concept, which negates the possibility of a philosophical examination. In English, the word "love," which is derived from Germanic forms of the Sanskrit lubh (desire), is broadly defined and hence imprecise, which generates first order problems of definition and meaning, which are resolved to some extent by the reference to the Greek terms, eros, philia, and agape.

a. Eros

The term eros (Greek erasthai) is used to refer to that part of love constituting a passionate, intense desire for something; it is often referred to as a sexual desire, hence the modern notion of "erotic" (Greek erotikos). In Plato's writings however, eros is held to be a common desire that seeks transcendental beauty-the particular beauty of an individual reminds us of true beauty that exists in the world of Forms or Ideas (Phaedrus 249E: "he who loves the beautiful is called a lover because he partakes of it." Trans. Jowett). The Platonic-Socratic position maintains that the love we generate for beauty on this earth can never be truly satisfied until we die; but in the meantime we should aspire beyond the particular stimulating image in front of us to the contemplation of beauty in itself.

The implication of the Platonic theory of eros is that ideal beauty, which is reflected in the particular images of beauty we find, becomes interchangeable across people and things, ideas, and art: to love is to love the Platonic form of beauty-not a particular individual, but the element they posses of true (Ideal) beauty. Reciprocity is not necessary to Plato's view of love, for the desire is for the object (of Beauty), than for, say, the company of another and shared values and pursuits.

Many in the Platonic vein of philosophy hold that love is an intrinsically higher value than appetitive or physical desire. Physical desire, they note, is held in common with the animal kingdom. Hence, it is of a lower order of reaction and stimulus than a rationally induced love---that is, a love produced by rational discourse and exploration of ideas, which in turn defines the pursuit of Ideal beauty. Accordingly, the physical love of an object, an idea, or a person in itself is not a proper form of love, love being a reflection of that part of the object, idea, or person, that partakes in Ideal beauty.

b. Philia

In contrast to the desiring and passionate yearning of eros, philia entails a fondness and appreciation of the other. For the Greeks, the term philia incorporated not just friendship, but also loyalties to family and polis-one's political community, job, or discipline. Philia for another may be motivated, as Aristotle explains in the Nicomachean Ethics, Book VIII, for the agent's sake or for the other's own sake. The motivational distinctions are derived from love for another because the friendship is wholly useful as in the case of business contacts, or because their character and values are pleasing (with the implication that if those attractive habits change, so too does the friendship), or for the other in who they are in themselves, regardless of one's interests in the matter. The English concept of friendship roughly captures Aristotle's notion of philia, as he writes: "things that cause friendship are: doing kindnesses; doing them unasked; and not proclaiming the fact when they are done" (Rhetoric, II. 4, trans. Rhys Roberts).

Aristotle elaborates on the kinds of things we seek in proper friendship, suggesting that the proper basis for philia is objective: those who share our dispositions, who bear no grudges, who seek what we do, who are temperate, and just, who admire us appropriately as we admire them, and so on. Philia could not emanate from those who are quarrelsome, gossips, aggressive in manner and personality, who are unjust, and so on. The best characters, it follows, may produce the best kind of friendship and hence love: indeed, how to be a good character worthy of philia is the theme of the Nicomachaen Ethics. The most rational man is he who would be the happiest, and he, therefore, who is capable of the best form of friendship, which between two "who are good, and alike in virtue" is rare (NE, VIII.4 trans. Ross). We can surmise that love between such equals-Aristotle's rational and happy men-would be perfect, with circles of diminishing quality for those who are morally removed from the best. He characterizes such love as "a sort of excess of feeling". (NE, VIII.6)

Friendships of a lesser quality may also be based on the pleasure or utility that is derived from another's company. A business friendship is based on utility--on mutual reciprocity of similar business interests; once the business is at an end, then the friendship dissolves. This is similar to those friendships based on the pleasure that is derived from the other's company, which is not a pleasure enjoyed for whom the other person is in himself, but in the flow of pleasure from his actions or humour.

The first condition for the highest form of Aristotelian love is that a man loves himself. Without an egoistic basis, he cannot extend sympathy and affection to others (NE, IX.8). Such self-love is not hedonistic, or glorified, depending on the pursuit of immediate pleasures or the adulation of the crowd, it is instead a reflection of his pursuit of the noble and virtuous, which culminate in the pursuit of the reflective life. Friendship with others is required "since his purpose is to contemplate worthy actions... to live pleasantly... sharing in discussion and thought" as is appropriate for the virtuous man and his friend (NE, IX.9). The morally virtuous man deserves in turn the love of those below him; he is not obliged to give an equal love in return, which implies that the Aristotelian concept of love is elitist or perfectionist: "In all friendships implying inequality the love also should be proportional, i.e. the better should be more loved than he loves." (NE, VIII, 7,). Reciprocity, although not necessarily equal, is a condition of Aristotelian love and friendship, although parental love can involve a one-sided fondness.

c. Agape

Agape refers to the paternal love of God for man and of man for God but is extended to include a brotherly love for all humanity. (The Hebrew ahev has a slightly wider semantic range than agape). Agape arguably draws on elements from both eros and philia in that it seeks a perfect kind of love that is at once a fondness, a transcending of the particular, and a passion without the necessity of reciprocity. The concept is expanded on in the Judaic-Christian tradition of loving God: "You shall love the Lord your God with all your heart, and with all your soul, and with all your might" (Deuteronomy 6:5) and loving "thy neighbour as thyself" (Leviticus 19:18). The love of God requires absolute devotion that is reminiscent of Plato's love of Beauty (and Christian translators of Plato such as St. Augustine employed the connections), which involves an erotic passion, awe, and desire that transcends earthly cares and obstacles. Aquinas, on the other hand, picked up on the Aristotelian theories of friendship and love to proclaim God as the most rational being and hence the most deserving of one's love, respect, and considerations.

The universalist command to "love thy neighbor as thyself" refers the subject to those surrounding him, whom he should love unilaterally if necessary. The command employs the logic of mutual reciprocity, and hints at an Aristotelian basis that the subject should love himself in some appropriate manner: for awkward results would ensue if he loved himself in a particularly inappropriate, perverted manner! (Philosophers can debate the nature of "self-love" implied in this-from the Aristotelian notion that self-love is necessary for any kind of interpersonal love, to the condemnation of egoism and the impoverished examples that pride and self-glorification from which to base one's love of another. St. Augustine relinquishes the debate--he claims that no command is needed for a man to love himself (De bono viduitatis, xxi.) Analogous to the logic of "it is better to give than to receive", the universalism of agape requires an initial invocation from someone: in a reversal of the Aristotelian position, the onus for the Christian is on the morally superior to extend love to others. Nonetheless, the command also entails an egalitarian love-hence the Christian code to "love thy enemies" (Matthew 5:44-45). Such love transcends any perfectionist or aristocratic notions that some are (or should be) more loveable than others. Agape finds echoes in the ethics of Kant and Kierkegaard, who assert the moral importance of giving impartial respect or love to another person qua human being in the abstract.

However, loving one's neighbor impartially (James 2:9) invokes serious ethical concerns, especially if the neighbor ostensibly does not warrant love. Debate thus begins on what elements of a neighbor's conduct should be included in agape, and which should be excluded. Early Christians asked whether the principle applied only to disciples of Christ or to all. The impartialists won the debate asserting that the neighbor's humanity provides the primary condition of being loved; nonetheless his actions may require a second order of criticisms, for the logic of brotherly love implies that it is a moral improvement on brotherly hate. For metaphysical dualists, loving the soul rather than the neighbor's body or deeds provides a useful escape clause-or in turn the justification for penalizing the other's body for sin and moral transgressions, while releasing the proper object of love-the soul-from its secular torments. For Christian pacifists, "turning the other cheek" to aggression and violence implies a hope that the aggressor will eventually learn to comprehend the higher values of peace, forgiveness, and a love for humanity.

The universalism of agape runs counter to the partialism of Aristotle and poses a variety of ethical implications. Aquinas admits a partialism in love towards those we are related while maintaining that we should be charitable to all, whereas others such as Kierkegaard insist on impartiality. Recently, Hugh LaFallotte (1991) has noted that to love those one is partial towards is not necessarily a negation of the impartiality principle, for impartialism could admit loving those closer to one as an impartial principle, and, employing Aristotle's conception of self-love, iterates that loving others requires an intimacy that can only be gained from being partially intimate. Others would claim that the concept of universal love, of loving all equally, is not only impracticable, but logically empty-Aristotle, for example, argues: "One cannot be a friend to many people in the sense of having friendship of the perfect type with them, just as one cannot be in love with many people at once (for love is a sort of excess of feeling, and it is the nature of such only to be felt towards one person)" (NE, VIII.6).

2. The Nature of Love: Further Conceptual Considerations

Presuming love has a nature, it should be, to some extent at least, describable within the concepts of language. But what is meant by an appropriate language of description may be as philosophically beguiling as love itself. Such considerations invoke the philosophy of language, of the relevance and appropriateness of meanings, but they also provide the analysis of "love" with its first principles. Does it exist and if so, is it knowable, comprehensible, and describable? Love may be knowable and comprehensible to others, as understood in the phrases, "I am in love", "I love you", but what "love" means in these sentences may not be analyzed further: that is, the concept "love" is irreducible-an axiomatic, or self-evident, state of affairs that warrants no further intellectual intrusion, an apodictic category perhaps, that a Kantian may recognize.

The epistemology of love asks how we may know love, how we may understand it, whether it is possible or plausible to make statements about others or ourselves being in love (which touches on the philosophical issue of private knowledge versus public behavior). Again, the epistemology of love is intimately connected to the philosophy of language and theories of the emotions. If love is purely an emotional condition, it is plausible to argue that it remains a private phenomenon incapable of being accessed by others, except through an expression of language, and language may be a poor indicator of an emotional state both for the listener and the subject. Emotivists would hold that a statement such as "I am in love" is irreducible to other statements because it is a nonpropositional utterance, hence its veracity is beyond examination. Phenomenologists may similarly present love as a non-cognitive phenomenon. Scheler, for example, toys with Plato's Ideal love, which is cognitive, claiming: "love itself... brings about the continuous emergence of ever-higher value in the object--just as if it were streaming out from the object of its own accord, without any exertion (even of wishing) on the part of the lover" (1954, p. 57). The lover is passive before the beloved.

The claim that "love" cannot be examined is different from that claiming "love" should not be subject to examination-that it should be put or left beyond the mind's reach, out of a dutiful respect for its mysteriousness, its awesome, divine, or romantic nature. But if it is agreed that there is such a thing as "love" conceptually speaking, when people present statements concerning love, or admonitions such as "she should show more love," then a philosophical examination seems appropriate: is it synonymous with certain patterns of behavior, of inflections in the voice or manner, or by the apparent pursuit and protection of a particular value ("Look at how he dotes upon his flowers-he must love them")?

If love does possesses "a nature" which is identifiable by some means-a personal expression, a discernible pattern of behavior, or other activity, it can still be asked whether that nature can be properly understood by humanity. Love may have a nature, yet we may not possess the proper intellectual capacity to understand it-accordingly, we may gain glimpses perhaps of its essence-as Socrates argues in The Symposium, but its true nature being forever beyond humanity's intellectual grasp. Accordingly, love may be partially described, or hinted at, in a dialectic or analytical exposition of the concept but never understood in itself. Love may therefore become an epiphenomenal entity, generated by human action in loving, but never grasped by the mind or language. Love may be so described as a Platonic Form, belonging to the higher realm of transcendental concepts that mortals can barely conceive of in their purity, catching only glimpses of the Forms' conceptual shadows that logic and reason unveil or disclose.

Another view, again derived from Platonic philosophy, may permit love to be understood by certain people and not others. This invokes a hierarchical epistemology, that only the initiated, the experienced, the philosophical, or the poetical or musical, may gain insights into its nature. On one level this admits that only the experienced can know its nature, which is putatively true of any experience, but it also may imply a social division of understanding-that only philosopher kings may know true love. On the first implication, those who do not feel or experience love are incapable (unless initiated through rite, dialectical philosophy, artistic processes, and so on) of comprehending its nature, whereas the second implication suggests (though this is not a logically necessary inference) that the non-initiated, or those incapable of understanding, feel only physical desire and not "love." Accordingly, "love" belongs either to the higher faculties of all, understanding of which requires being educated in some manner or form, or it belongs to the higher echelons of society-to a priestly, philosophical, or artistic, poetic class. The uninitiated, the incapable, or the young and inexperienced-those who are not romantic troubadours-are doomed only to feel physical desire. This separating of love from physical desire has further implications concerning the nature of romantic love.

3. The Nature of Love: Romantic Love

Romantic love is deemed to be of a higher metaphysical and ethical status than sexual or physical attractiveness alone. The idea of romantic love initially stems from the Platonic tradition that love is a desire for beauty-a value that transcends the particularities of the physical body. For Plato, the love of beauty culminates in the love of philosophy, the subject that pursues the highest capacity of thinking. The romantic love of knights and damsels emerged in the early medieval ages (11th Century France, fine amour) a philosophical echo of both Platonic and Aristotelian love and literally a derivative of the Roman poet, Ovid and his Ars Amatoria. Romantic love theoretically was not to be consummated, for such love was transcendentally motivated by a deep respect for the lady; however, it was to be actively pursued in chivalric deeds rather than contemplated-which is in contrast to Ovid's persistent sensual pursuit of conquests!

Modern romantic love returns to Aristotle's version of the special love two people find in each other's virtues-one soul and two bodies, as he poetically puts it. It is deemed to be of a higher status, ethically, aesthetically, and even metaphysically than the love that behaviorists or physicalists describe.

4. The Nature of Love: Physical, Emotional, Spiritual

Some may hold that love is physical, i.e., that love is nothing but a physical response to another whom the agent feels physically attracted to. Accordingly, the action of loving encompasses a broad range of behavior including caring, listening, attending to, preferring to others, and so on. (This would be proposed by behaviorists). Others (physicalists, geneticists) reduce all examinations of love to the physical motivation of the sexual impulse-the simple sexual instinct that is shared with all complex living entities, which may, in humans, be directed consciously, sub-consciously or pre-rationally toward a potential mate or object of sexual gratification.

Physical determinists, those who believe the world to entirely physical and that every event has a prior (physical cause), consider love to be an extension of the chemical-biological constituents of the human creature and be explicable according to such processes. In this vein, geneticists may invoke the theory that the genes (an individual's DNA) form the determining criteria in any sexual or putative romantic choice, especially in choosing a mate. However, a problem for those who claim that love is reducible to the physical attractiveness of a potential mate, or to the blood ties of family and kin which forge bonds of filial love, is that it does not capture the affections between those who cannot or wish not to reproduce-that is, physicalism or determinism ignores the possibility of romantic, ideational love---it may explain eros, but not philia or agape.

Behaviorism, which stems from the theory of the mind and asserts a rejection of Cartesian dualism between mind and body, entails that love is a series of actions and preferences which is thereby observable to oneself and others. The behaviorist theory that love is observable (according to the recognizable behavioral constraints corresponding to acts of love) suggests also that it is theoretically quantifiable: that A acts in a certain way (actions X,Y,Z) around B, more so than he does around C, suggests that he "loves" B more than C. The problem with the behaviorist vision of love is that it is susceptible to the poignant criticism that a person's actions need not express their inner state or emotions---A may be a very good actor. Radical behaviorists, such as B. F. Skinner, claim that observable and unobservable behavior such as mental states can be examined from the behaviorist framework, in terms of the laws of conditioning. On this view, that one falls in love may go unrecognised by the casual observer, but the act of being in love can be examined by what events or conditions led to the agent's believing she was in love: this may include the theory that being in love is an overtly strong reaction to a set of highly positive conditions in the behavior or presence of another.

Expressionist love is similar to behaviorism in that love is considered an expression of a state of affairs towards a beloved, which may be communicated through language (words, poetry, music) or behavior (bringing flowers, giving up a kidney, diving into the proverbial burning building), but which is a reflection of an internal, emotional state, rather than an exhibition of physical responses to stimuli. Others in this vein may claim love to be a spiritual response, the recognition of a soul that completes one's own soul, or complements or augments it. The spiritualist vision of love incorporates mystical as well as traditional romantic notions of love, but rejects the behaviorist or physicalist explanations.

Those who consider love to be an aesthetic response would hold that love is knowable through the emotional and conscious feeling it provokes yet which cannot perhaps be captured in rational or descriptive language: it is instead to be captured, as far as that is possible, by metaphor or by music.

5. Love: Ethics and Politics

The ethical aspects in love involve the moral appropriateness of loving, and the forms it should or should not take. The subject area raises such questions as: is it ethically acceptable to love an object, or to love oneself? Is love to oneself or to another a duty? Should the ethically minded person aim to love all people equally? Is partial love morally acceptable or permissible (that is, not right, but excusable)? Should love only involve those with whom the agent can have a meaningful relationship? Should love aim to transcend sexual desire or physical appearances? May notions of romantic, sexual love apply to same sex couples? Some of the subject area naturally spills into the ethics of sex, which deals with the appropriateness of sexual activity, reproduction, hetero and homosexual activity, and so on.

In the area of political philosophy, love can be studied from a variety of perspectives. For example, some may see love as an instantiation of social dominance by one group (males) over another (females), in which the socially constructed language and etiquette of love is designed to empower men and disempower women. On this theory, love is a product of patriarchy, and acts analogously to Karl Marx's view of religion (the opiate of the people) that love is the opiate of women. The implication is that were they to shrug off the language and notions of "love," "being in love," "loving someone," and so on, they would be empowered. The theory is often attractive to feminists and Marxists, who view social relations (and the entire panoply of culture, language, politics, institutions) as reflecting deeper social structures that divide people into classes, sexes, and races.

This article has touched on some of the main elements of the philosophy of love. It reaches into many philosophical fields, notably theories of human nature, the self, and of the mind. The language of love, as it is found in other languages as well as in English, is similarly broad and deserves more attention.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle Nicomachean Ethics.
  • Aristotle Rhetoric. Rhys Roberts (trans.).
  • Augustine De bono viduitatis.
  • LaFallotte, Hugh (1991). "Personal Relations." Peter Singer (ed.) A Companion to Ethics. Blackwell, pp. 327-32.
  • Plato Phaedrus.
  • Plato Symposium.
  • Scheler, Max (1954). The Nature of Sympathy. Peter Heath (trans.). New Haven: Yale University Press.

Author Information

Alexander Moseley
United Kingdom

Virtue Ethics

Virtue ethics is a broad term for theories that emphasize the role of character and virtue in moral philosophy rather than either doing one’s duty or acting in order to bring about good consequences. A virtue ethicist is likely to give you this kind of moral advice: “Act as a virtuous person would act in your situation.”

Most virtue ethics theories take their inspiration from Aristotle who declared that a virtuous person is someone who has ideal character traits. These traits derive from natural internal tendencies, but need to be nurtured; however, once established, they will become stable. For example,  a virtuous person is someone who is kind across many situations over a lifetime because that is her character and not because she wants to maximize utility or gain favors or simply do her duty. Unlike deontological and consequentialist theories, theories of virtue ethics do not aim primarily to identify universal principles that can be applied in any moral situation. And virtue ethics theories deal with wider questions—“How should I live?” and “What is the good life?” and “What are proper family and social values?”

Since its revival in the twentieth century, virtue ethics has been developed in three main directions: Eudaimonism, agent-based theories, and the ethics of care. Eudaimonism bases virtues in human flourishing, where flourishing is equated with performing one’s distinctive function well. In the case of humans, Aristotle argued that our distinctive function is reasoning, and so the life “worth living” is one which we reason well. An agent-based theory emphasizes that virtues are determined by common-sense intuitions that we as observers judge to be admirable traits in other people. The third branch of virtue ethics, the ethics of care, was proposed predominately by feminist thinkers. It challenges the idea that ethics should focus solely on justice and autonomy; it argues that more feminine traits, such as caring and nurturing, should also be considered.

Here are some common objections to virtue ethics. Its theories provide a self-centered conception of ethics because human flourishing is seen as an end in itself and does not sufficiently consider the extent to which our actions affect other people. Virtue ethics also does not provide guidance on how we should act, as there are no clear principles for guiding action other than “act as a virtuous person would act given the situation.” Lastly, the ability to cultivate the right virtues will be affected by a number of different factors beyond a person's control due to education, society, friends and family. If moral character is so reliant on luck, what role does this leave for appropriate praise and blame of the person?

This article looks at how virtue ethics originally defined itself by calling for a change from the dominant normative theories of deontology and consequentialism. It goes on to examine some common objections raised against virtue ethics and then looks at a sample of fully developed accounts of virtue ethics and responses.

Table of Contents

  1. Changing Modern Moral Philosophy
    1. Anscombe
    2. Williams
    3. MacIntyre
  2. A Rival for Deontology and Utilitarianism
    1. How Should One Live?
    2. Character and Virtue
    3. Anti-Theory and the Uncodifiability of Ethics
    4. Conclusion
  3. Virtue Ethical Theories
    1. Eudaimonism
    2. Agent-Based Accounts of Virtue Ethics
    3. The Ethics of Care
    4. Conclusion
  4. Objections to Virtue Ethics
    1. Self-Centeredness
    2. Action-Guiding
    3. Moral Luck
  5. Virtue in Deontology and Consequentialism
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Changing Modern Moral Philosophy
    2. Overviews of Virtue Ethics
    3. Varieties of Virtue Ethics
    4. Collections on Virtue Ethics
    5. Virtue and Moral Luck
    6. Virtue in Deontology and Consequentialism

1. Changing Modern Moral Philosophy

a. Anscombe

In 1958 Elisabeth Anscombe published a paper titled "Modern Moral Philosophy" that changed the way we think about normative theories. She criticized modern moral philosophy's pre-occupation with a law conception of ethics. A law conception of ethics deals exclusively with obligation and duty. Among the theories she criticized for their reliance on universally applicable principles were J. S. Mill's utilitarianism and Kant's deontology. These theories rely on rules of morality that were claimed to be applicable to any moral situation (that is, Mill's Greatest Happiness Principle and Kant's Categorical Imperative). This approach to ethics relies on universal principles and results in a rigid moral code. Further, these rigid rules are based on a notion of obligation that is meaningless in modern, secular society because they make no sense without assuming the existence of a lawgiver---an assumption we no longer make.

In its place, Anscombe called for a return to a different way of doing philosophy. Taking her inspiration from Aristotle, she called for a return to concepts such as character, virtue and flourishing. She also emphasized the importance of the emotions and understanding moral psychology. With the exception of this emphasis on moral psychology, Anscombe's recommendations that we place virtue more centrally in our understanding of morality were taken up by a number of philosophers. The resulting body of theories and ideas has come to be known as virtue ethics.

Anscombe's critical and confrontational approach set the scene for how virtue ethics was to develop in its first few years. The philosophers who took up Anscombe's call for a return to virtue saw their task as being to define virtue ethics in terms of what it is not---that is, how it differs from and avoids the mistakes made by the other normative theories. Before we go on to consider this in detail, we need to take a brief look at two other philosophers, Bernard Williams and Alasdair MacIntyre, whose call for theories of virtue was also instrumental in changing our understanding of moral philosophy.

b. Williams

Bernard Williams' philosophical work has always been characterized by its ability to draw our attention to a previously unnoticed but now impressively fruitful area for philosophical discussion. Williams criticized how moral philosophy had developed. He drew a distinction between morality and ethics. Morality is characterized mainly by the work of Kant and notions such as duty and obligation. Crucially associated with the notion of obligation is the notion of blame. Blame is appropriate because we are obliged to behave in a certain way and if we are capable of conforming our conduct and fail to, we have violated our duty.

Williams was also concerned that such a conception for morality rejects the possibility of luck. If morality is about what we are obliged to do, then there is no room for what is outside of our control. But sometimes attainment of the good life is dependant on things outside of our control.

In response, Williams takes a wider concept, ethics, and rejects the narrow and restricting concept of morality. Ethics encompasses many emotions that are rejected by morality as irrelevant. Ethical concerns are wider, encompassing friends, family and society and make room for ideals such as social justice. This view of ethics is compatible with the Ancient Greek interpretation of the good life as found in Aristotle and Plato.

c. MacIntyre

Finally, the ideas of Alasdair MacIntyre acted as a stimulus for the increased interest in virtue. MacIntyre's project is as deeply critical of many of the same notions, like ought, as Anscombe and Williams. However, he also attempts to give an account of virtue. MacIntyre looks at a large number of historical accounts of virtue that differ in their lists of the virtues and have incompatible theories of the virtues. He concludes that these differences are attributable to different practices that generate different conceptions of the virtues. Each account of virtue requires a prior account of social and moral features in order to be understood. Thus, in order to understand Homeric virtue you need to look its social role in Greek society. Virtues, then, are exercised within practices that are coherent, social forms of activity and seek to realize goods internal to the activity. The virtues enable us to achieve these goods. There is an end (or telos) that transcends all particular practices and it constitutes the good of a whole human life. That end is the virtue of integrity or constancy.

These three writers have all, in their own way, argued for a radical change in the way we think about morality. Whether they call for a change of emphasis from obligation, a return to a broad understanding of ethics, or a unifying tradition of practices that generate virtues, their dissatisfaction with the state of modern moral philosophy lay the foundation for change.

2. A Rival for Deontology and Utilitarianism

There are a number of different accounts of virtue ethics. It is an emerging concept and was initially defined by what it is not rather than what it is. The next section examines claims virtue ethicists initially made that set the theory up as a rival to deontology and consequentialism.

a. How Should One Live?

Moral theories are concerned with right and wrong behavior. This subject area of philosophy is unavoidably tied up with practical concerns about the right behavior. However, virtue ethics changes the kind of question we ask about ethics. Where deontology and consequentialism concern themselves with the right action, virtue ethics is concerned with the good life and what kinds of persons we should be. "What is the right action?" is a significantly different question to ask from "How should I live? What kind of person should I be?" Where the first type of question deals with specific dilemmas, the second is a question about an entire life. Instead of asking what is the right action here and now, virtue ethics asks what kind of person should one be in order to get it right all the time.

Whereas deontology and consequentialism are based on rules that try to give us the right action, virtue ethics makes central use of the concept of character. The answer to "How should one live?" is that one should live virtuously, that is, have a virtuous character.

b. Character and Virtue

Modern virtue ethics takes its inspiration from the Aristotelian understanding of character and virtue. Aristotelian character is, importantly, about a state of being. It's about having the appropriate inner states. For example, the virtue of kindness involves the right sort of emotions and inner states with respect to our feelings towards others. Character is also about doing. Aristotelian theory is a theory of action, since having the virtuous inner dispositions will also involve being moved to act in accordance with them. Realizing that kindness is the appropriate response to a situation and feeling appropriately kindly disposed will also lead to a corresponding attempt to act kindly.

Another distinguishing feature of virtue ethics is that character traits are stable, fixed, and reliable dispositions. If an agent possesses the character trait of kindness, we would expect him or her to act kindly in all sorts of situations, towards all kinds of people, and over a long period of time, even when it is difficult to do so. A person with a certain character can be relied upon to act consistently over a time.

It is important to recognize that moral character develops over a long period of time. People are born with all sorts of natural tendencies. Some of these natural tendencies will be positive, such as a placid and friendly nature, and some will be negative, such as an irascible and jealous nature. These natural tendencies can be encouraged and developed or discouraged and thwarted by the influences one is exposed to when growing up. There are a number of factors that may affect one's character development, such as one's parents, teachers, peer group, role-models, the degree of encouragement and attention one receives, and exposure to different situations. Our natural tendencies, the raw material we are born with, are shaped and developed through a long and gradual process of education and habituation.

Moral education and development is a major part of virtue ethics. Moral development, at least in its early stages, relies on the availability of good role models. The virtuous agent acts as a role model and the student of virtue emulates his or her example. Initially this is a process of habituating oneself in right action. Aristotle advises us to perform just acts because this way we become just. The student of virtue must develop the right habits, so that he tends to perform virtuous acts. Virtue is not itself a habit. Habituation is merely an aid to the development of virtue, but true virtue requires choice, understanding, and knowledge. The virtuous agent doesn't act justly merely out of an unreflective response, but has come to recognize the value of virtue and why it is the appropriate response. Virtue is chosen knowingly for its own sake.

The development of moral character may take a whole lifetime. But once it is firmly established, one will act consistently, predictably and appropriately in a variety of situations.

Aristotelian virtue is defined in Book II of the Nicomachean Ethics as a purposive disposition, lying in a mean and being determined by the right reason. As discussed above, virtue is a settled disposition. It is also a purposive disposition. A virtuous actor chooses virtuous action knowingly and for its own sake. It is not enough to act kindly by accident, unthinkingly, or because everyone else is doing so; you must act kindly because you recognize that this is the right way to behave. Note here that although habituation is a tool for character development it is not equivalent to virtue; virtue requires conscious choice and affirmation.

Virtue "lies in a mean" because the right response to each situation is neither too much nor too little. Virtue is the appropriate response to different situations and different agents. The virtues are associated with feelings. For example: courage is associated with fear, modesty is associated with the feeling of shame, and friendliness associated with feelings about social conduct. The virtue lies in a mean because it involves displaying the mean amount of emotion, where mean stands for appropriate. (This does not imply that the right amount is a modest amount. Sometimes quite a lot may be the appropriate amount of emotion to display, as in the case of righteous indignation). The mean amount is neither too much nor too little and is sensitive to the requirements of the person and the situation.

Finally, virtue is determined by the right reason. Virtue requires the right desire and the right reason. To act from the wrong reason is to act viciously. On the other hand, the agent can try to act from the right reason, but fail because he or she has the wrong desire. The virtuous agent acts effortlessly, perceives the right reason, has the harmonious right desire, and has an inner state of virtue that flows smoothly into action. The virtuous agent can act as an exemplar of virtue to others.

It is important to recognize that this is a perfunctory account of ideas that are developed in great detail in Aristotle. They are related briefly here as they have been central to virtue ethics' claim to put forward a unique and rival account to other normative theories. Modern virtue ethicists have developed their theories around a central role for character and virtue and claim that this gives them a unique understanding of morality. The emphasis on character development and the role of the emotions allows virtue ethics to have a plausible account of moral psychology---which is lacking in deontology and consequentialism. Virtue ethics can avoid the problematic concepts of duty and obligation in favor of the rich concept of virtue. Judgments of virtue are judgments of a whole life rather than of one isolated action.

c. Anti-Theory and the Uncodifiability of Ethics

In the first book of the Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle warns us that the study of ethics is imprecise. Virtue ethicists have challenged consequentialist and deontological theories because they fail to accommodate this insight. Both deontological and consequentialist type of theories rely on one rule or principle that is expected to apply to all situations. Because their principles are inflexible, they cannot accommodate the complexity of all the moral situations that we are likely to encounter.

We are constantly faced with moral problems. For example: Should I tell my friend the truth about her lying boyfriend? Should I cheat in my exams? Should I have an abortion? Should I save the drowning baby? Should we separate the Siamese twins? Should I join the fuel protests? All these problems are different and it seems unlikely that we will find the solution to all of them by applying the same rule. If the problems are varied, we should not expect to find their solution in one rigid and inflexible rule that does not admit exception. If the nature of the thing we are studying is diverse and changing, then the answer cannot be any good if it is inflexible and unyielding. The answer to "how should I live?" cannot be found in one rule. At best, for virtue ethics, there can be rules of thumb---rules that are true for the most part, but may not always be the appropriate response.

The doctrine of the mean captures exactly this idea. The virtuous response cannot be captured in a rule or principle, which an agent can learn and then act virtuously. Knowing virtue is a matter of experience, sensitivity, ability to perceive, ability to reason practically, etc. and takes a long time to develop. The idea that ethics cannot be captured in one rule or principle is the "uncodifiability of ethics thesis." Ethics is too diverse and imprecise to be captured in a rigid code, so we must approach morality with a theory that is as flexible and as situation-responsive as the subject matter itself. As a result some virtue ethicists see themselves as anti-theorists, rejecting theories that systematically attempt to capture and organize all matters of practical or ethical importance.

d. Conclusion

Virtue ethics initially emerged as a rival account to deontology and consequentialism. It developed from dissatisfaction with the notions of duty and obligation and their central roles in understanding morality. It also grew out of an objection to the use of rigid moral rules and principles and their application to diverse and different moral situations. Characteristically, virtue ethics makes a claim about the central role of virtue and character in its understanding of moral life and uses it to answer the questions "How should I live? What kind of person should I be?" Consequentialist theories are outcome-based and Kantian theories are agent-based. Virtue ethics is character-based.

3. Virtue Ethical Theories

Raising objections to other normative theories and defining itself in opposition to the claims of others, was the first stage in the development of virtue ethics. Virtue ethicists then took up the challenge of developing full fledged accounts of virtue that could stand on their own merits rather than simply criticize consequentialism and deontology. These accounts have been predominantly influenced by the Aristotelian understanding of virtue. While some virtue ethics take inspiration from Plato's, the Stoics', Aquinas', Hume's and Nietzsche's accounts of virtue and ethics, Aristotelian conceptions of virtue ethics still dominate the field. There are three main strands of development for virtue ethics: Eudaimonism, agent-based theories and the ethics of care.

a. Eudaimonism

"Eudaimonia" is an Aristotelian term loosely (and inadequately) translated as happiness. To understand its role in virtue ethics we look to Aristotle's function argument. Aristotle recognizes that actions are not pointless because they have an aim. Every action aims at some good. For example, the doctor's vaccination of the baby aims at the baby's health, the English tennis player Tim Henman works on his serve so that he can win Wimbledon, and so on. Furthermore, some things are done for their own sake (ends in themselves) and some things are done for the sake of other things (means to other ends). Aristotle claims that all the things that are ends in themselves also contribute to a wider end, an end that is the greatest good of all. That good is eudaimonia. Eudaimonia is happiness, contentment, and fulfillment; it's the name of the best kind of life, which is an end in itself and a means to live and fare well.

Aristotle then observes that where a thing has a function the good of the thing is when it performs its function well. For example, the knife has a function, to cut, and it performs its function well when it cuts well. This argument is applied to man: man has a function and the good man is the man who performs his function well. Man's function is what is peculiar to him and sets him aside from other beings---reason. Therefore, the function of man is reason and the life that is distinctive of humans is the life in accordance with reason. If the function of man is reason, then the good man is the man who reasons well. This is the life of excellence or of eudaimonia. Eudaimonia is the life of virtue---activity in accordance with reason, man's highest function.

The importance of this point of eudaimonistic virtue ethics is that it reverses the relationship between virtue and rightness. A utilitarian could accept the value of the virtue of kindness, but only because someone with a kind disposition is likely to bring about consequences that will maximize utility. So the virtue is only justified because of the consequences it brings about. In eudaimonist virtue ethics the virtues are justified because they are constitutive elements of eudaimonia (that is, human flourishing and wellbeing), which is good in itself.

Rosalind Hursthouse developed one detailed account of eudaimonist virtue ethics. Hursthouse argues that the virtues make their possessor a good human being. All living things can be evaluated qua specimens of their natural kind. Like Aristotle, Hursthouse argues that the characteristic way of human beings is the rational way: by their very nature human beings act rationally, a characteristic that allows us to make decisions and to change our character and allows others to hold us responsible for those decisions. Acting virtuously---that is, acting in accordance with reason---is acting in the way characteristic of the nature of human beings and this will lead to eudaimonia. This means that the virtues benefit their possessor. One might think that the demands of morality conflict with our self-interest, as morality is other-regarding, but eudaimonist virtue ethics presents a different picture. Human nature is such that virtue is not exercised in opposition to self-interest, but rather is the quintessential component of human flourishing. The good life for humans is the life of virtue and therefore it is in our interest to be virtuous. It is not just that the virtues lead to the good life (e.g. if you are good, you will be rewarded), but rather a virtuous life is the good life because the exercise of our rational capacities and virtue is its own reward.

It is important to note, however, that there have been many different ways of developing this idea of the good life and virtue within virtue ethics. Philippa Foot, for example, grounds the virtues in what is good for human beings. The virtues are beneficial to their possessor or to the community (note that this is similar to MacIntyre's argument that the virtues enable us to achieve goods within human practices). Rather than being constitutive of the good life, the virtues are valuable because they contribute to it.

Another account is given by perfectionists such as Thomas Hurka, who derive the virtues from the characteristics that most fully develop our essential properties as human beings. Individuals are judged against a standard of perfection that reflects very rare or ideal levels of human achievement. The virtues realize our capacity for rationality and therefore contribute to our well-being and perfection in that sense.

b. Agent-Based Accounts of Virtue Ethics

Not all accounts of virtue ethics are eudaimonist. Michael Slote has developed an account of virtue based on our common-sense intuitions about which character traits are admirable. Slote makes a distinction between agent-focused and agent-based theories. Agent-focused theories understand the moral life in terms of what it is to be a virtuous individual, where the virtues are inner dispositions. Aristotelian theory is an example of an agent-focused theory. By contrast, agent-based theories are more radical in that their evaluation of actions is dependent on ethical judgments about the inner life of the agents who perform those actions. There are a variety of human traits that we find admirable, such as benevolence, kindness, compassion, etc. and we can identify these by looking at the people we admire, our moral exemplars.

c. The Ethics of Care

Finally, the Ethics of Care is another influential version of virtue ethics. Developed mainly by feminist writers, such as Annette Baier, this account of virtue ethics is motivated by the thought that men think in masculine terms such as justice and autonomy, whereas woman think in feminine terms such as caring. These theorists call for a change in how we view morality and the virtues, shifting towards virtues exemplified by women, such as taking care of others, patience, the ability to nurture, self-sacrifice, etc. These virtues have been marginalized because society has not adequately valued the contributions of women. Writings in this area do not always explicitly make a connection with virtue ethics. There is much in their discussions, however, of specific virtues and their relation to social practices and moral education, etc., which is central to virtue ethics.

d. Conclusion

There are many different accounts of virtue ethics. The three types discussed above are representative of the field. There is a large field, however, of diverse writers developing other theories of virtue. For example, Christine Swanton has developed a pluralist account of virtue ethics with connections to Nietzsche. Nietzsche's theory emphasizes the inner self and provides a possible response to the call for a better understanding of moral psychology. Swanton develops an account of self-love that allows her to distinguish true virtue from closely related vices, e.g. self-confidence from vanity or ostentation, virtuous and vicious forms of perfectionism, etc. She also makes use of the Nietzschean ideas of creativity and expression to show how different modes of acknowledgement are appropriate to the virtues.

Historically, accounts of virtue have varied widely. Homeric virtue should be understood within the society within which it occurred. The standard of excellence was determined from within the particular society and accountability was determined by one's role within society. Also, one's worth was comparative to others and competition was crucial in determining one's worth.

Other accounts of virtue ethics are inspired from Christian writers such as Aquinas and Augustine (see the work of David Oderberg). Aquinas' account of the virtues is distinctive because it allows a role for the will. One's will can be directed by the virtues and we are subject to the natural law, because we have the potential to grasp the truth of practical judgments. To possess a virtue is to have the will to apply it and the knowledge of how to do so. Humans are susceptible to evil and acknowledging this allows us to be receptive to the virtues of faith, hope and charity---virtues of love that are significantly different from Aristotle's virtues.

The three types of theories covered above developed over long periods, answering many questions and often changed in response to criticisms. For example, Michael Slote has moved away from agent-based virtue ethics to a more Humean-inspired sentimentalist account of virtue ethics. Humean accounts of virtue ethics rely on the motive of benevolence and the idea that actions should be evaluated by the sentiments they express. Admirable sentiments are those that express a concern for humanity. The interested reader must seek out the work of these writers in the original to get a full appreciation of the depth and detail of their theories.

4. Objections to Virtue Ethics

Much of what has been written on virtue ethics has been in response to criticisms of the theory. The following section presents three objections and possible responses, based on broad ideas held in common by most accounts of virtue ethics.

a. Self-Centeredness

Morality is supposed to be about other people. It deals with our actions to the extent that they affect other people. Moral praise and blame is attributed on the grounds of an evaluation of our behavior towards others and the ways in that we exhibit, or fail to exhibit, a concern for the well-being of others. Virtue ethics, according to this objection, is self-centered because its primary concern is with the agent's own character. Virtue ethics seems to be essentially interested in the acquisition of the virtues as part of the agent's own well-being and flourishing. Morality requires us to consider others for their own sake and not because they may benefit us. There seems to be something wrong with aiming to behave compassionately, kindly, and honestly merely because this will make oneself happier.

Related to this objection is a more general objection against the idea that well-being is a master value and that all other things are valuable only to the extent that they contribute to it. This line of attack, exemplified in the writings of Tim Scanlon, objects to the understanding of well-being as a moral notion and sees it more like self-interest. Furthermore, well-being does not admit to comparisons with other individuals. Thus, well-being cannot play the role that eudaimonists would have it play.

This objection fails to appreciate the role of the virtues within the theory. The virtues are other-regarding. Kindness, for example, is about how we respond to the needs of others. The virtuous agent's concern is with developing the right sort of character that will respond to the needs of others in an appropriate way. The virtue of kindness is about being able to perceive situations where one is required to be kind, have the disposition to respond kindly in a reliable and stable manner, and be able to express one's kind character in accordance with one's kind desires. The eudaimonist account of virtue ethics claims that the good of the agent and the good of others are not two separate aims. Both rather result from the exercise of virtue. Rather than being too self-centered, virtue ethics unifies what is required by morality and what is required by self-interest.

b. Action-Guiding

Moral philosophy is concerned with practical issues. Fundamentally it is about how we should act. Virtue ethics has criticized consequentialist and deontological theories for being too rigid and inflexible because they rely on one rule or principle. One reply to this is that these theories are action guiding. The existence of "rigid" rules is a strength, not a weakness because they offer clear direction on what to do. As long as we know the principles, we can apply them to practical situations and be guided by them. Virtue ethics, it is objected, with its emphasis on the imprecise nature of ethics, fails to give us any help with the practicalities of how we should behave. A theory that fails to be action-guiding is no good as a moral theory.

The main response to this criticism is to stress the role of the virtuous agent as an exemplar. Virtue ethics reflects the imprecise nature of ethics by being flexible and situation-sensitive, but it can also be action-guiding by observing the example of the virtuous agent. The virtuous agent is the agent who has a fully developed moral character, who possesses the virtues and acts in accordance with them, and who knows what to do by example. Further, virtue ethics places considerable of emphasis on the development of moral judgment. Knowing what to do is not a matter of internalizing a principle, but a life-long process of moral learning that will only provide clear answers when one reaches moral maturity. Virtue ethics cannot give us an easy, instant answer. This is because these answers do not exist. Nonetheless, it can be action-guiding if we understand the role of the virtuous agent and the importance of moral education and development. If virtue consists of the right reason and the right desire, virtue ethics will be action-guiding when we can perceive the right reason and have successfully habituated our desires to affirm its commands.

c. Moral Luck

Finally, there is a concern that virtue ethics leaves us hostage to luck. Morality is about responsibility and the appropriateness of praise and blame. However, we only praise and blame agents for actions taken under conscious choice. The road to virtue is arduous and many things outside our control can go wrong. Just as the right education, habits, influences, examples, etc. can promote the development of virtue, the wrong influencing factors can promote vice. Some people will be lucky and receive the help and encouragement they need to attain moral maturity, but others will not. If the development of virtue (and vice) is subject to luck, is it fair to praise the virtuous (and blame the vicious) for something that was outside of their control? Further, some accounts of virtue are dependent on the availability of external goods. Friendship with other virtuous agents is so central to Aristotelian virtue that a life devoid of virtuous friendship will be lacking in eudaimonia. However, we have no control over the availability of the right friends. How can we then praise the virtuous and blame the vicious if their development and respective virtue and vice were not under their control?

Some moral theories try to eliminate the influence of luck on morality (primarily deontology). Virtue ethics, however, answers this objection by embracing moral luck. Rather than try to make morality immune to matters that are outside of our control, virtue ethics recognizes the fragility of the good life and makes it a feature of morality. It is only because the good life is so vulnerable and fragile that it is so precious. Many things can go wrong on the road to virtue, such that the possibility that virtue is lost, but this vulnerability is an essential feature of the human condition, which makes the attainment of the good life all the more valuable.

5. Virtue in Deontology and Consequentialism

Virtue ethics offers a radically different account to deontology and consequentialism. Virtue ethics, however, has influenced modern moral philosophy not only by developing a full-fledged account of virtue, but also by causing consequentialists and deontologists to re-examine their own theories with view to taking advantage of the insights of virtue.

For years Deontologists relied mainly on the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals for discussions of Kant's moral theory. The emergence of virtue ethics caused many writers to re-examine Kant's other works. Metaphysics of MoralsAnthropology From a Pragmatic Point of View and, to a lesser extent, Religion Within the Limits of Reason Alone, have becomes sources of inspiration for the role of virtue in deontology. Kantian virtue is in some respects similar to Aristotelian virtue. In the Metaphysics of Morals, Kant stresses the importance of education, habituation, and gradual development---all ideas that have been used by modern deontologists to illustrate the common sense plausibility of the theory. For Kantians, the main role of virtue and appropriate character development is that a virtuous character will help one formulate appropriate maxims for testing. In other respects, Kantian virtue remains rather dissimilar from other conceptions of virtue. Differences are based on at least three ideas: First, Kantian virtue is a struggle against emotions. Whether one thinks the emotions should be subjugated or eliminated, for Kant moral worth comes only from the duty of motive, a motive that struggles against inclination. This is quite different from the Aristotelian picture of harmony between reason and desire. Second, for Kant there is no such thing as weakness of will, understood in the Aristotelian sense of the distinction between continence and incontinence. Kant concentrates on fortitude of will and failure to do so is self-deception. Finally, Kantians need to give an account of the relationship between virtue as occurring in the empirical world and Kant's remarks about moral worth in the noumenal world (remarks that can be interpreted as creating a contradiction between ideas in the Groundwork and in other works).

Consequentialists have found a role for virtue as a disposition that tends to promote good consequences. Virtue is not valuable in itself, but rather valuable for the good consequences it tends to bring about. We should cultivate virtuous dispositions because such dispositions will tend to maximize utility. This is a radical departure from the Aristotelian account of virtue for its own sake. Some consequentialists, such as Driver, go even further and argue that knowledge is not necessary for virtue.

Rival accounts have tried to incorporate the benefits of virtue ethics and develop in ways that will allow them to respond to the challenged raised by virtue ethics. This has led to very fruitful and exciting work being done within this area of philosophy.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Changing Modern Moral Philosophy

  • Anscombe, G.E. M., "Modern Moral Philosophy", Philosophy, 33 (1958).
    • The original call for a return to Aristotelian ethics.
  • MacIntyre, A., After Virtue (London: Duckworth, 1985).
    • His first outline of his account of the virtues.
  • Murdoch, I., The Sovereignty of Good (London: Ark, 1985)
  • Williams, B., Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy (London: Fontana, 1985).
    • Especially Chapter 10 for the thoughts discussed in this paper.

b. Overviews of Virtue Ethics

  • Oakley, J., "Varieties of Virtue Ethics", Ratio, vol. 9 (1996)
  • Trianosky, G.V. "What is Virtue Ethics All About?" in Statman D., Virtue Ethics (Cambridge: Edinburgh University Press, 1997)

c. Varieties of Virtue Ethics

  • Adkins, A.W.H., Moral Values and Political Behaviour in Ancient Greece from Homer to the End of the Fifth Century (London: Chatto and Windus, 1972).
    • An account of Homeric virtue.
  • Baier, A., Postures of the Mind (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1985)
  • Blum, L.W., Friendship, Altruism and Morality (London: 1980)
  • Cottingham, J., "Partiality and the Virtues", in Crisp R. and Slote M., How Should One Live? (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1996)
  • Cottingham, J., "Religion, Virtue and Ethical Culture", Philosophy, 69 (1994)
  • Cullity, G., "Aretaic Cognitivism", American Philosophical Quarterly, vol. 32, no. 4, (1995a).
    • Particularly good on the distinction between aretaic and deontic.
  • Cullit,y G., "Moral Character and the Iteration Problem", Utilitas, vol. 7, no. 2, (1995b)
  • Dent, N.J.H., "The Value of Courage", Philosophy, vol. 56 (1981)
  • Dent, N.J.H., "Virtues and Actions", The Philosophical Quarterly, vol. 25 (1975)
  • Dent, N.J.H., The Psychology of the Virtues (G.B.: Cambridge University Press, 1984)
  • Driver, J., "Monkeying with Motives: Agent-based Virtue Ethics", Utilitas, vol. 7, no. 2 (1995).
    • A critique of Slote's agent-based virtue ethics.
  • Foot, P., Natural Goodness (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2001).
    • Her more recent work, developing new themes in her account of virtue ethics.
  • Foot, P., Virtues and Vices (Oxford: Blackwell, 1978).
    • Her original work, setting out her version of virtue ethics.
  • Hursthouse, R., "Virtue Theory and Abortion", Philosophy and Public Affairs, 20, (1991)
  • Hursthouse, R., On Virtue Ethics (Oxford: OUP, 1999).
    • A book length account of eudaimonist virtue ethics, incorporating many of the ideas from her previous work and fully developed new ideas and responses to criticisms.
  • McDowell, J., "Incontinence and Practical Wisdom in Aristotle", in Lovibond S and Williams S.G., Essays for David Wiggins, Aristotelian Society Series, Vol.16 (Oxford: Blackwell, 1996)
  • McDowel,l J., "Virtue and Reason", The Monist, 62 (1979)
  • Roberts, R.C., "Virtues and Rules", Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, vol. LI, no. 2 (1991)
  • Scanlon, T.M., What We Owe Each Other (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1998).
    • A comprehensive criticism of well-being as the foundation of moral theories.
  • Slote, M., From Morality to Virtue (New York: OUP, 1992).
    • His original account of agent-based virtue ethics.
  • Slote, M., Morals from Motives, (Oxford: OUP, 2001).
    • A new version of sentimentalist virtue ethics.
  • Swanton, C., Virtue Ethics (New York: OUP, 2003).
    • A pluralist account of virtue ethics, inspired from Nietzschean ideas.
  • Walker, A.D.M., "Virtue and Character", Philosophy, 64 (1989)

d. Collections on Virtue Ethics

  • Crisp, R. and M. Slote, How Should One Live? (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1996).
    • A collection of more recent as well as critical work on virtue ethics, including works by Kantian critics such as O'Neill, consequentialist critics such as Hooker and Driver, an account of Humean virtue by Wiggins, and others.
  • Crisp, R. and M. Slote, Virtue Ethics (New York: OUP, 1997).
    • A collection of classic papers on virtue ethics, including Anscombe, MacIntyre, Williams, etc.
  • Engstrom, S., and J. Whiting, Aristotle, Kant and the Stoics (USE: Cambridge University Press, 1996).
    • A collection bringing together elements from Aristotle, Kant and the Stoics on topics such as the emotions, character, moral development, etc.
  • Hursthouse, R., G. Lawrence and W. Quinn, Virtues and Reasons (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995).
    • A collections of essays in honour of Philippa Foot, including contributions by Blackburn, McDowell, Kenny, Quinn, and others.
  • Rorty, A.O., Essays on Aristotle's Ethics (USA: University of California Press, 1980).
    • A seminal collection of papers interpreting the ethics of Aristotle, including contributions by Ackrill, McDowell and Nagel on eudaimonia, Burnyeat on moral development, Urmson on the doctrine of the mean, Wiggins and Rorty on weakness of will, and others.
  • Statman, D., Virtue Ethics (Cambridge: Edinburgh University Press, 1997).
    • A collection of contemporary work on virtue ethics, including a comprehensive introduction by Statman, an overview by Trianosky, Louden and Solomon on objections to virtue ethics, Hursthouse on abortion and virtue ethics, Swanton on value, and others.

e. Virtue and Moral Luck

  • Andree, J., "Nagel, Williams and Moral Luck", Analysis 43 (1983).
    • An Aristotelian response to the problem of moral luck.
  • Nussbaum, M., Love's Knowledge (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1990)
  • Nussbaum, M., The Fragility of Goodness (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1986).
    • Includes her original response to the problem of luck as well as thoughts on rules as rules of thumb, the role of the emotions, etc.
  • Statman, D., Moral Luck (USA: State University of New York Press, 1993).
    • An excellent introduction by Statman as well as almost every article written on moral luck, including Williams' and Nagel’s original discussions (and a postscript by Williams).

f. Virtue in Deontology and Consequentialism

  • Baron, M.W., Kantian Ethics Almost Without Apology (USA: Cornell University Press, 1995).
    • A book length account of a neo-Kantian theory that takes virtue and character into account.
  • Baron, M.W., P. Pettit and M. Slote, Three Methods of Ethics (GB: Blackwell, 1997).
    • Written by three authors adopting three perspectives, deontology, consequentialism and virtue ethics, this is an excellent account of how the three normative theories relate to each other.
  • Drive,r J., Uneasy Virtue (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001).
    • A book length account of a consequentialist version of virtue ethics, incorporating many of her ideas from previous pieces of work.
  • Herman, B., The Practice of Moral Judgement (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1993).
    • Another neo-Kantian who has a lot to say on virtue and character.
  • Hooker, B., Ideal Code, Real World (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2000).
    • A modern version of rule-consequentialism, which is in many respects sensitive to the insights of virtue.
  • O'Neill, "Kant’s Virtues", in Crisp R. and Slote M., How Should One Live? (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1996).
    • One of the first Kantian responses to virtue ethics.
  • Sherman, N., The Fabric of Character (GB: Clarendon Press, 1989).
    • An extremely sympathetic account of Aristotelian and Kantian ideas on the emotions, virtue and character.
  • Sherman, N., Making a Necessity of Virtue (USA: Cambridge University Press, 1997).

Author Information

Nafsika Athanassoulis
Keele University
United Kingdom

Medieval Theories of Practical Reason

Practical reason is the employment of reason in service of living a good life, and the great medieval thinkers all gave accounts of it. Practical reason is reasoning about, or better toward, an action, and an action always has a goal or end, this end being understood to be in some sense good. The medievals generally concurred that it was always in some way directed toward the agent’s ultimate goal or final end (although there were important differences in how the agent’s relation to the final end was conceived).

In every medieval account, we find important roles for the intellect and the will—for the intellect in identifying goods to be honored and pursued, and for the will in tending toward such goods. Medieval accounts always paid attention to the relationship between practical reason and the moral trinity of happiness, law, and virtue. Perhaps the most important difference between these accounts is that some philosophers assign primacy to the intellect but others assign it to the will. This difference has led historians to identify schools of thought called intellectualism and voluntarism.

This article traces some of the main lines of medieval thought about practical reason, from its roots in Aristotle and Augustine through some of its most interesting expressions in Aquinas and Scotus, the ablest exponents, respectively, of intellectualism and voluntarism. The article points out the important differences among theorists, but also highlights the themes common to all the medieval, and it indicates some points of contact with contemporary work on practical reason, including debates about particularism and internalism.

Table of Contents

  1. Precursors: Aristotle and Augustine
    1. Aristotle
    2. Augustine
    3. Intellectualism and Voluntarism
  2. Intellectualist Theory: Aquinas
    1. The Interaction of Intellect and Will in Generating Action
    2. The Practical Syllogism
    3. Happiness, Law, and Virtue
    4. Final Comments
  3. Voluntarist Theory: Scotus
    1. Freedom of the Will
    2. Synderesis, Conscience, and the Natural Law
    3. The Non-Teleological Character of Scotus’ Thought
    4. Note on Ockham
  4. Medieval and Modern
    1. The Current Influence of Aquinas and Scotus
    2. The Medievals and Particularism
    3. The Medievals and Internalism
  5. Conclusion: Common Themes among the Medievals
  6. References and Further Reason
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1.Precursors: Aristotle and Augustine

The two most important influences upon medieval thought about practical reason were Aristotle and St. Augustine, and this first section identifies a few of the key ideas they bequeathed to their successors.

a. Aristotle

Aristotle’s theory is teleological and eudaimonist: All action is undertaken for an end, and our proximate ends, when we act rationally, form a coherent hierarchical structure leading up to our final end of eudaimonia (happiness, flourishing). Although we presuppose rather than reason about our final end formally considered—it is that which we pursue for its own sake, and for the sake of which we pursue all else; it is that which makes life worthwhile—practical reason does help us work out the correct way to think about just what that final end is, and about how to move toward it. Reason does this by means of the practical syllogism: The major premise identifies the end, some good recognized as worthy of pursuit; the minor premise interprets the agent’s situation in relation to the end; the conclusion is characteristically a choice leading directly to action that pursues means to the end (for example, Some pleasant relaxation would be good right now; reading this novel would be pleasant and relaxing; I shall read it (and straightaway I commence reading)). The work practical reason does in formulating the minor premise and identifying the means is called deliberation. While we cannot deliberate about the end identified in the major premise as an end, we can deliberate about it under its aspect as a means to some further end. Thus practical reason can (although seldom will it explicitly do so in practice) take the form of a chain of syllogisms, with the major premise of the first identifying the final end to be pursued, and the conclusion both identifying the means to that end and supplying the major premise of the next (now serving as a proximate end), until we finally reach down to something to be done here and now (the means to the most proximate end). Here is a compressed example: I should flourish as a human being, and my flourishing requires the practice of civic virtue, so I should practice civic virtue; I should practice civic virtue, in my circumstances civic virtue requires me to enlist in the army to defend my city, so I should enlist; I should enlist, and here is a recruiter to whom I must speak in order to enlist; I choose to speak to the recruiter.

Notice that in this syllogism the premises do not mention desire—the majors do not state “I want X,” but rather that X is a good to be pursued. Yet the conclusion does mention desire, or rather is a desire (for that is what choice is, deliberated desire). This is not an oversight on Aristotle's part. Although he holds that reason and desire work together to produce action, he insists that desire naturally tends to what cognition identifies as good—as he puts it at Metaphysics 1072a29, “desire is consequent upon opinion rather than opinion on desire, for the thinking is the starting point.” Reason serves as the formal cause of action by identifying the actions (determining what “form” our actions should take) leading to the apprehended good, which is the final cause or end of action; desire serves as the efficient cause, putting the man in motion toward the end. So when a prospective end is recognized as good, a desire for it follows. The practical syllogism serves to transmit the desire for the end identified by reason as good down to means identified by reason as the appropriate way to the end.

Yet, because cognition includes sense perception, things other than those identified by reason can be presented to desire as good (as any dieter knows when offered dessert). This allows Aristotle to propose a solution to the problem of akrasia or “weakness of will,” the choosing of something we know to be bad—to put it crudely, we know it is bad, but it looks good. For reasoning to be effectively practical, and for practice to be rational, the desires must be in line with reason; for the desires to be consistently in line with reason, the moral virtues, which “train” the emotions to bring them into line with reason, are necessary. When the moral virtues, together with prudence, are present, Aristotle takes it that reasoning well and acting accordingly will follow naturally (we can speak of virtue as “second nature”).

b.  Augustine

The idea of virtuous action becoming natural is one of the points on which Augustine will disagree with Aristotle. He learns from his own experience (for example, in his robbing of the pear tree recounted in Confessions II) and from his reflections on the sin of the angels (see On Free Choice of the Will III) that the will can choose what the intellect rejects. Although the intellect is required for willing in the sense that it presents objects as good to the will, willing has no cause other than the will itself. Augustine, unlike some later Augustinians, is a eudaimonist, seeing our final end as eternal life in peace, that is, in right relation to and enjoyment of God (see The City of God XIX). Yet it should be noted that, drawing on his own experience and the writings of St. Paul, he identifies “two loves” of the will, love of God and love of self, and holds that the struggle between these two for ascendancy is the key to each human life, and indeed to history. No trace of such a struggle is to be found in Aristotle; nor   is there any such role for faith as we find in Augustine. Both in Confessions XI and in The City of God XIX Augustine chronicles the woes of temporal human existence, and the impossibility of finding peace, our final end, during our life on earth. It is thus in some sense reasonable for us to turn humbly to faith in God as our only hope for salvation. This turning, or conversion, requires an act of willed submission to God. Only after this can the intellect know, by faith, the true character of our final end, and thus only after such willing can practical reason become truly informed as to how to act. The need for conversion brings one more un-Aristotelian idea into the picture, that of obedience to divine law.

c.  Intellectualism and Voluntarism

Aristotle’s account of practical reason could be characterized as intellectualist, not   because he ignores the very important role of desire, but because reason plays the leading role, and desire is naturally inclined to follow reason (“desire is consequent upon opinion … for the thinking is the starting point”). Further, although Aristotle employs the concept of rational wish, there is serious debate as to whether this can rightly be identified with what the medievals, following Augustine, call the will. By contrast, Augustine may be termed a voluntarist, not because reason is unimportant, but because with him it is the will that plays the primary role. As we have seen, even in the absence of passion, the will may choose contrary to the judgment of the intellect, and it is only by willed humility that we can come to know our true final end by faith.

Throughout much of the Christian Middle Ages, Augustine’s influence predominates. And although much important work was done on topics highly relevant to practical reasoning—for example, passages in Peter Lombard’s Sentences, and the work of  St. Anselm on the will and of Abelard on ethics—practical reasoning itself was not generally treated in a rigorous and systematic way. But in the twelfth century, translations of Aristotle’s works, together with Muslim and Jewish commentaries, began to flow into Western Europe, and to gain in influence, eventually rivaling or surpassing the importance of Augustine’s thought. These thinkers do treat practical reasoning in rigorous fashion, and under their influence, so too do the great thinkers of the High Middle Ages. In doing so, all draw on both Aristotle and Augustine, and although it is common practice to identify some as “Aristotelians” and “intellectualists,” and others as “Augustinians” and “voluntarists,” this does run the risk of oversimplifying. The reader should keep in mind that there is no one account of the relation between intellect and will that all intellectualists held, nor one opposed account that all voluntarists held. Instead, scholars sort thinkers according to whether they hold certain characteristic theses concerning such questions as these: Is the intellect or the will the higher power? Is the will a passive power (a “moved mover”) or an active one (a “self-mover”)? What sort of cause does the intellect exert on the will’s choice—does it specify the act of will, or can the will act independently and control its own choices (and can it act contrary to judgment)? A metaphor commonly used by those now classified as voluntarists was that of the Lord and the Lampbearer: The will is the lord, deciding where to go; the intellect contributes to the decision,  but in the same manner as the servant who lights the way (or rather the possible ways) with a lamp (see for example Henry of Ghent, Quodlibet Iq14). Intellectualists, by contrast, would see the intellect as the lord, and the will as the lieutenant or executive officer.

In the intellectualist camp we can probably include St. Albert (see the first McCluskey entry for a discussion) and John of Paris;  in the voluntarist camp, St. Bonaventure and Henry of Ghent. Others, such as Giles of Rome, occupy a position in the disputed middle ground (see Kent for an intellectualist reading of Giles; Eardley for a moderately voluntarist reading). The following sections will focus on the two figures who are arguably the most important and influential thinkers of the High Middle Ages, taking Aquinas as a representative of intellectualism, and Scotus as a representative of voluntarism. But it should be kept in mind that Aquinas treats Augustine as an authority and has a much more robust conception of the will than does Aristotle, and likewise that Scotus draws heavily upon Aristotle and insists upon a very important role for the intellect.

2.  Intellectualist Theory: Aquinas

Like both Aristotle and Augustine, St. Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274) is a eudaimonist; like Augustine he takes seriously both obedience to divine law and the role of the will in the genesis of action; yet like Aristotle he is an intellectualist. (This is generally accepted, but it should be noted that some scholars have argued for more somewhat more voluntarist readings of Aquinas than that offered below. See Eardley and Westberg for sources, discussion, and criticism of these interpretations.) For Aquinas, practical reasoning plays out in a dynamic exchange between intellect and will, an exchange in which intellect always has the first word (reason being the first principle of human action), but in which the will plays a key role and the agent remains free.

a.  The Interaction of Intellect and Will in Generating Action

For Aquinas, the will tends naturally toward the good, but to act it must have the good presented to it by reason in its practical capacity. Further, after apprehending and willing the good, the agent must decide whether and how to pursue it, which involves a process of collaboration between intellect and will. Let us begin with an example, making use of Ralph McInerny’s immortal character, Fifi LaRue. In the midst of a bad day, Fifi sees a travel poster advertising a Roman holiday, apprehends “how nice that would be,” and forms a wish to go. She considers the idea as befitting, and enjoys it. Nothing seems to stand in the way; the trip would be delightful and cause no problems; she forms the intention to go. But she must take counsel as to how she could accomplish it. Due to time constraints, she must fly, but could take a bus or taxi to the airport; she consents to both. Yet the bus would be so crowded … let it be the taxi then, she judges, and so chooses. Here is a taxi; she must hail it by raising her arm. So she commands, and so uses her arm. The taxi pulls up, and off she goes.

This example involves the steps and terms Aquinas spells out in questions 8-17 of the prima secundae (the first part of the second part of the Summa theologiae),  and we should now look at some of the details of this complex discussion: The intellect apprehends something as good and thereby presents it to the will, which then wills or wishes that good as an end—call this simple willing. (Strictly speaking, it would be more proper to say the agent apprehends the good by means of her intellect and simply wills it by means of her will; this is always what Aquinas means, although for convenience he often speaks of the intellect apprehending and so forth.) This does not yet mean that the agent pursues the good; she may decide not to for a variety of reasons—perhaps it is pleasant but sinful, and she immediately rejects it—or may be as yet undecided. She may then continue to consider the good, apprehend it as befitting in some ways, and, in a second act of will regarding the possible end, enjoy it (while we perfectly enjoy only an end possessed, we may imperfectly enjoy or entertain the idea of possessing it). Again, actual pursuit need not follow—perhaps the good is befitting but not currently feasible (Fifi, perhaps, lacks the money). Finally, the agent may actually undertake to pursue this good as an end, to tend toward it, and this act of will Aquinas calls intention (and here again, Aquinas is explicit that an act of reason precedes this act of will; cf. q12a1ad3).

Now intending the good as an end, the agent must determine how best to pursue it—she must decide upon means to the end. When the means are not immediately obvious, the agent deliberates or takes counsel, in which reason seeks out acceptable ways to the end; such ways being found the will then consents to them. Reason must then issue a judgment (q14a1) as to which is preferable, followed by the act of will called choice (q13, q15a3ad3). So, Fifi took counsel as to how to reach the airport, identifies and accepts two ways (bus or taxi), then judges the taxi superior and so chooses that means. But in considering how to get from America to Rome, she is able to skip the counsel/consent stage because the means (flying) are immediately obvious (she has no time for sailing).

The choice having been made, it is time to execute. Here again we see the same pattern of an act of intellect, command, followed by an act of will, use, whereby the will employs faculties of the soul, parts of the body, or material objects to make the choice effective. So when the taxi draws near, Fifi sees that she must wave, and commands “this (waving) is to be done.”  This command informs, or gives exact shape to, her already present will to take a taxi (her choice). Her will then uses her arm, puts it in motion.

Now the process described is a complex one, having as many as twelve steps from the initial apprehension of a good down to use. Do we really go through all of this? Aquinas does not mean that we consciously rehearse all the steps every time we perform an action (just as we do not consciously rehearse rules of grammar in articulating a thought). The twelve-step process is a logical reconstruction of the role of intellect and will in generating action. The steps are those we could consciously rehearse, and perhaps sometimes do (if facing a complicated matter, say, or if doggedly pressed for an explanation or justification of a past action). Usually, our actual practical reasoning will be much more concise. Daniel Westberg and others have argued that we should understand Aquinas to have in mind a streamlined version of the process centered around intention (apprehension and intention), decision (judgment and choice), and execution (command and use), with intellect and will working in unison at each stage. Other acts mentioned by Aquinas, such as counsel and consent, may serve auxiliary roles in complex situations.

Westberg stresses that we should not take Aquinas to mean that at each stage intellect renders its judgment and then the will decides whether or not to follow it—as we will see, this is the way of the voluntarists. Instead, the will naturally tends toward the good presented to it by the intellect at each stage. So for example in discussing whether choice is an act of intellect or of will, Aquinas says choice “is materially an act of the will, but formally an act of the reason” (q13a1)—roughly, the intellect in presenting some particular thing or action as good “forms” or makes specific the will’s general tendency toward the good (Aquinas follows Aristotle in maintaining that, like substances, accidents, including actions, can be analyzed in terms of form and matter). It is because the act of choice is completed by the will (judgment alone is not yet choice) that Aquinas is prepared to call it an act of will. Yet there is a real sense in which the stage Westberg calls “decision” comprises one act of the reasoning agent, an act whose form derives from reason and whose matter is supplied by will.

Voluntarists will charge that here the intellect is determining the will, which is thus not free. Now Aquinas calls that free which “retains the power of being inclined to various things” (Iaq83a1); a subject is free if it has this power. A rock is not free just because it can be inclined to heat or chill by the external power of fire or ice. Aquinas’s implied response to the voluntarist charge in the course of his discussion of choice is that the act of choice is free because the judgment that forms it is free, and the judgment is free because in considering any particular good, reason can focus on how it is good or on how it is lacking in goodness, leading to a judgment for or against it (q13a6). Worth noting, too, is that the will (and those other affective powers, the passions) play a role in attracting or diverting the attention of reason during the counsel it takes prior to judgment. But Aquinas’s more complete response would be that, strictly, it is not the will or reason that is free; the person is free in making the judgment and thus in making the choice the judgment informs. The intellect does not make the judgment, the person—the willing and feeling, as well as thinking, person—makes it by means of his intellect. The person is the subject that “retains the power” of, say, sitting closer to or further from the fire and thus being hot or cold; he exercises this power by means of his faculties of reason and will.

All of this shows how things can in many ways be more complicated, and less mechanical, than the initial description of Fifi’s pursuit of a Roman holiday suggested. One especially important factor, just touched on, is the reflexivity of both intellect and will. The will, for example, uses both intellect and itself throughout the process of deliberation (see q16a4c&ad3). In reaching her judgment, Fifi focused on the bus being crowded, but if her affections were more attuned to saving money, she might have focused instead on its economy. Further, she could at any point consider whether she should deliberate further and decide whether or not to do so. There is a potentially infinite regress here, but not an actual one. In taking counsel, having consented to taking the bus, she could yield to impatience and hop on the bus she sees rather than thinking further and realizing that a taxi would be better. Neither the bus nor the taxi, nor for that matter any other means or particular good in this life, is a perfect good. Thus none of them determine reason in its favor. Our judgment, and thus our choice, remain free. This highlights one reason Aquinas can be called an intellectualist, namely that he identifies reason as the source of freedom (see Iaq59a3: “wherever there is intellect, there is free-will”). But again, if this seems, paradoxically, to locate freedom in reason rather than will, it is well to remember that Aquinas’s talk of the intellect doing this, and the will that, is all shorthand for the person acting by means of each faculty. It is the person, not her faculties, who judges and chooses; and does both freely.

b.  The Practical Syllogism

But how does such reasoning relate to the Aristotelian notion of the practical syllogism Aquinas adopts? The intellectual acts regarding, and the pursuant intention of, the end supply the major premise (say, “I should go to Rome.”). The minor premise is supplied by deliberation, resulting in judgment and choice (“Taking a cab to the airport is the best way to Rome.”). This may take a major premise-minor premise form as above, but often the deliberation of the agent would be better represented as a longer argument with several premises, or as an iterated series of two-premise arguments finally reaching down to the concrete action. In this case, the means to the end initially chosen would then become the object of intention as a proximate end (q12a2), and counsel would be taken as to the means to that end, and so forth, until something that can be done here and now is reached (much as we saw above in the discussion of Aristotle).

Two questions present themselves at this point: What sort of reasoning goes into the formation of intentions, and how is this reasoning, and the reasoning involved in counsel, done well or ill? Sketching an answer to these questions requires a discussion of happiness, law, and virtue.

c.  Happiness, Law, and Virtue

Aquinas agrees with Aristotle that we have a final end, and with Augustine that it is not to be attained in this life (it is not a Roman holiday, unless perhaps in a very metaphorical sense). Using the term "happiness” is a potentially misleading, but common, translation of beatitude. Blessedness or flourishing would be better, for in fact our final end is our completion or perfection. Aquinas takes it that we all agree, or would agree upon reflection, on that. There is neither need nor room for practical reasoning about it. Yet we disagree over that in which it consists: one says wealth, another power, another (Fifi, perhaps) pleasure. And here we can reason: The mere fact that Aquinas wrote the first five questions of the prima secundae shows that he thought so. There he argues that because the will wills the good universally, and only God is universally good, our final end is attained in virtuous activity culminating in the right relation to God (although we may not know that the happiness we seek can be found only in and with God), which consists principally in loving contemplation and secondarily in obedient service. Only this perfects our nature as rational creatures. Although Aquinas agrees with Augustine that this end can be attained, or even adequately understood, only by God’s grace, Aquinas takes it that we do tend naturally (even if inadequately) toward it, and that its attainment fulfills, as well as transcends, our nature (“Grace does not destroy nature but perfects it” Iaq1a8ad2). What reason is able to make out about our final end, then, is reliable and authoritative, even if always incomplete.

There is a long-standing controversy in Aquinas scholarship concerning the relationship between what Aquinas calls imperfect and perfect beatitude: Do we have a natural final end of humanly virtuous activity and a distinct supernatural final end of contemplation of and friendship with God? Or do we have just one final end that is naturally unattainable? Here readers are referred to Bradley for a very thorough discussion of the issues involved.

Because by our nature we have a final end, any other end we have (going to Rome, perhaps) could be reconsidered in its light, and since everything we do is (perhaps unconsciously) done for the sake of the final end (Ia-IIaeq1a6), every other good we pursue, though seen as an end, is also a means to our final end, and under this aspect can be deliberated about, evaluated, and judged appropriate or not. In this sense, ends too are objects of counsel and judgment (q14a2). Fifi might adopt the end of going to Rome capriciously, but she might also stand back and take counsel about it under its aspect of a means to her conception of her final end. That is the sort of reasoning that can go into the formation of intentions. To see how Aquinas thinks such reasoning, as well as the reasoning about means, should be done, we must look at how his discussion of the final end relates to his discussion of the natural law.

As natural creatures, we have a natural inclination (in fact, an ordered set of natural inclinations) toward our perfection as human beings. As rational creatures, we can understand and endorse these inclinations, and articulate them into principles of practical reason, which are at the same time precepts of the natural law. How so? As Pamela Hall and Jean Porter have argued, the process of articulation involves a reflective, and developing, grasp of human nature and its tendencies, including an understanding of it and them as good. This understanding is ultimately founded on the recognition that human nature is created and directed by God, Goodness itself (this recognition can be achieved, however imperfectly, by means of natural knowledge of God). This allows the articulated principles to meet the criteria of law (q90a4): They are ordinances of reason (our own, and ultimately God’s) for the common good (due to our social nature), made by Him who has care of the community (again, God), and promulgated (they are made known, or knowable, to us through our natural inclinations). So although the precepts of the natural law ultimately derive their authority from God, they can be known independently of any knowledge of God—as Bradley puts it, they are “metaphysically theonomous” but “logically autonomous”)—and knowledge of them certainly does not require revelation.

Briefly setting out the inclinations and some of the precepts should illustrate this process of articulation, and at the same time give some indication of how it is connected with our pursuit of our final end. Like all things, we are naturally inclined toward our own good or perfection (good is that which all things seek), and thus as being is the first thing apprehended by reason simply, good is the first thing apprehended by reason as practical, or as directed toward action. And Aquinas takes it that, just as a grasp of the meaning of being and non-being leads naturally to knowledge of the principle of noncontradiction, so a grasp of good and evil leads to knowledge of the first principle of practical reason, good is to be done and pursued, and evil avoided: “All other precepts of the natural law are based upon this: so that whatever the practical reason naturally apprehends as man's good (or evil) belongs to the precepts of the natural law as something to be done or avoided” (q94a2). And what do we naturally apprehend as good? Those things toward which we are naturally inclined, for good is an end and these are our ends by nature. Aquinas identifies three levels of these inclinations: That common to all substances (the inclination to continue to exist), that shared with other animals (inclinations to reproduce and to educate one’s offspring), and that proper to rational beings (to know the truth, ultimately about God, and to live in society). Phrases such as “and so forth” and “and other such things” occur in this passage, indicating that this is a quick overview rather than an exhaustive statement of the content of the natural law.

How are these inclinations articulated into precepts? This question might take the form of a procedural question concerning how we might move from an inclination to a norm (a version of the concern about moving from is to ought); this is addressed above (the inclinations are directives given by eternal reason—the natural law is a participation in the eternal law in the sense that our natural inclinations have their origin in God’s plan and creative action (q91a2)). But it might also take the substantive form of asking how we move from the inclinations mentioned to particular norms, and this needs to be explained. As we saw, Aquinas holds that as soon as we understand the meaning of the terms “good” and “evil,” we naturally understand that good is to be done and pursued and evil avoided—we have this knowledge by a “natural habit” he calls synderesis, (see q94a1ad2 and Iaq79a12). We know other things in this way too: That we are to fulfill our special obligations to others, and to do evil to no one—these are elucidations of the first principle, and from them flow a number of other principles, which have also been revealed to us in the Decalogue (see Ia-IIaeq100): The command to honor one’s parents functions as a paradigm for honoring one’s indebtedness in general; the commands forbidding murder, adultery, and theft speak to refraining from doing evil to others by deed; the commands forbidding false witness and coveting speak to refraining from doing evil by word or thought.

Aquinas is not as explicit as we might wish about how we acquire this knowledge, and there is some dispute here among commentators. One question is, must we acquire it at all? Does not Aquinas say that the principles grasped by synderesis are self-evident (if that is a good translation of per se nota)? The answer is that, yes, we must acquire it, for there is no innate knowledge; synderesis is a habit and so must be acquired. We do acquire it naturally, in this sense, that once we come to understand the terms employed in the principles, the principles are naturally known to be true. Experience and reflection are needed to grasp the meaning of such terms as good and evil, the proper objects of special obligations, the scope of non-maleficence. In this process our natural inclinations play a role: life, family, social life, and knowledge are good for each, and our social nature further directs us to attend to the common good and the good of our neighbor as well as our own private good. We might sketch the process as follows (although Aquinas never puts it quite this way): Good is to be done and evil avoided. So first, since good is to be done, and special obligations indicate goods owed to others, they are to be fulfilled. Second, since evil is to be avoided, it is to be done to no one (our social inclination here coming into play); we are naturally inclined to life, family, and society, so obtaining these things is good for each and losing them evil; thus murder, adultery, and so forth are evil and so not to be done.

In any event, once we have such principles in hand, as Aquinas takes it we all do, we have also in hand a way of evaluating whether we should allow our simple willings (such as, “how nice a Roman holiday would be”) to pass into intention—would it be good or evil to go now to Rome—is it consistent or otherwise with my flourishing as a rational creature? Would it for example violate any special obligation I am under, or perhaps require stealing? As said above, any proximate end an agent is considering whether to adopt may also be seen as a means to the agent’s final end, and its suitability as such may be judged by its accord with precepts of the natural law—these should serve, we may say, as penultimate major premises, under the first principle of practical reason, of any practical syllogism (or, when stated negatively, as a “filter” for all prospective means or proximate ends).

There is one major piece of the puzzle we have yet to deal with, the role of virtue in all of this. First, how exactly do these three, blessedness, law, and virtue, fit together? As indicated above, the natural law is a participation in the eternal law that resides primarily in our natural inclinations: the rational creature “has a share of the Eternal Reason, whereby it has a natural inclination to its proper act and end: and this participation of the eternal law in the rational creature is called the natural law” (q91a2). Our natural inclinations direct us toward our proper end, that is to say toward beatitudo, and the attainment of it is the fulfillment of our inclinations. But as we have also seen, our blessedness consists in virtuous activity (culminating in the loving contemplation of God). Such being the case, we should expect the natural law to direct us toward virtuous activity, and Aquinas does say explicitly that the natural law prescribes virtuous activity (q94a3, and see Pinckaers for an interesting development of the idea that the natural inclinations are the “seeds of the virtues,” into which they grow through the work of reason and habituation). So natural law, through informing our natural inclinations, provides the direction toward our final end, through the virtues as (constitutive) means to it.

Second, how does virtue play this role? We move toward our end through free, reasoned action, and cannot simply decide to grasp our final end. We must make a series of choices and carry them out, and it is here that virtue plays its principal role. One thing we clearly must do is reason well about how to act; we require excellence in practical reasoning. And that is to say we require prudence, which just is the virtue that applies right reason to action. But we also require the moral virtues such as justice and fortitude, which enable our knowledge of both the ends and means in practical reasoning. Aquinas is clear, as Aristotle was not, that we naturally know the ends we should pursue (this is the role of synderesis; see above, and also IIa-IIaeq47a6), but he also insists that we are rightly disposed toward that end by the moral virtues (Ia-IIaeq65a1)—the moral virtues safeguard us from “forgetting” our ends under the influence of vice, custom, or passion (q94a6)—fortitude, for instance, helps us control our fear of dangers so as to remain committed to the common good. The virtues also enable us to find the right means to the end. This is properly the work of prudence. Looking at how prudence does this work will clarify how the moral virtues play a supporting role in it. Aquinas says prudence has eight “quasi-integral parts” which can be classified as follows: Those that supply knowledge (memory and understanding or an intuitive grasp of the salient features of the present situation), those that acquire knowledge (docility and shrewdness), that which uses knowledge (reasoning, constructing the practical syllogism), and those that apply knowledge in command, the chief act of prudence (foresight directs present actions to the foreseen end, circumspection adjusts means to circumstances, and caution avoids obstacles to realizing the end). Prudence depends on the moral virtues not just to safeguard reason’s grasp of principles, but throughout its reasoning toward action. The parts of prudence just enumerated should make this clear: Docility, for example, requires humility. Also, the identification of the correct means to an intended end involves the understanding, or intuitive grasp, of the situation that helps supply the minor premise in a practical syllogism (see IIa-IIaeq49a2ad1). But this understanding can be corrupted by the intrusion of passion, as in cases of incontinence (Ia-IIaeq77a2), a state to which all are subject, unless fortified by the moral virtues (Fifi’s hopping impatiently on the bus although a cab would have been better presents a very mild case of such incontinence).

d.  Final Comments

So for Aquinas practical reason is our capacity to discover how to move from our present situation toward the attainment of our final end. In successful practical reasoning, synderesis, prudence, and moral virtue work together to ensure that the action meets all of the criteria of a good action (q18aa1-4): suitability of object (what kind of action is this, borrowing or stealing?), due attention to circumstances (might frankness here and now be unduly embarrassing to one’s interlocutor?), and goodness of the end of action (is my goal in giving alms to impress a potential benefactor, or to succor the need of the less fortunate; ultimately, the end is good if and only if it is conducive to the agent’s final end). While practical reasoning presupposes our understanding of our final end as perfection, everything else in our practical lives, including our conception of our final end and to what extent we honor the principles grasped by synderesis, lies within its scope. When practical reasoning is done well leading to good action, the agent at one and the same time pursues her own perfection (the Aristotelian moment) and obeys the eternal law of God (the Augustinian)—the etymological connection between prudence and providence mirrors a metaphysical connection, for our practical reason participates in the eternal reason (q91a2; see also q19a10). Since our perfection is perfection as creatures, there is no tension between it and obedience—for Aquinas, practical reason is not torn between the fulfillment of obligation and the fulfillment of the agent.

3.  Voluntarist Theory: Scotus

The reception of Aristotle and other non-Christian thinkers was never entirely easy, and worries about the influence of Greek and Arabic thought culminated, just after Aquinas’s death, in the Condemnations of 1277. In publishing them, the Bishop of Paris condemned 219 propositions drawn chiefly from Aristotle and his commentators, and while the principal target of these condemnations was the teaching of a “radical Aristotelianism” (or “Latin Averroism”) contrary to the Catholic faith by masters on the Faculty of Arts such as Siger of Brabant, a number of the condemned propositions were drawn from Aquinas’s work, although Aquinas was not named. In their wake the marriage between Greek and Biblical thought, between Aristotle and Augustine we might say, is a stormier one. Among the chief concerns of the Condemnations were divine and human freedom, and later thinkers were especially concerned to safeguard both. Many of them, rejecting Aquinas’s account of human freedom, found it necessary to portray the will itself as free. One way they did this was to stress the will’s independence from determination by nature, including the natural power of the intellect and the second nature imparted by virtues. The will was seen as free rather than as natural, and as nobler than the intellect—thus these thinkers are often called voluntarists.

John Duns Scotus (c. 1266-1308) is the most impressive and influential of the post-1277 thinkers, and his sharp break with eudaimonism in many ways anticipates modern moral theory, especially that of Kant. It should be noted, though, that even in making this break Scotus is working within the medieval tradition, drawing here especially on St. Anselm’s work On the Fall of the Devil;   Scotus is also indebted to his Franciscan predecessors and fellow-travelers such as Henry of Ghent. The following presents some of the main lines of his account of practical reason, but readers should be aware that there are currently some major disputes over how to interpret Scotus; some of these will be mentioned, but readers are invited to consult the secondary sources mentioned for further information.

a.  Freedom of the Will

Scotus emphasizes the freedom of the will in three key ways. The first two are rooted in his (characteristically voluntarist) teaching that the will is a self-mover rather than moved by anything else (an active rather than passive power); the third helps explain this capacity for self-movement. The first, then, lies in his emphasis on the dominance of the will over other powers, including the intellect. Just as in seeing we can focus on an object not in the center of our visual field, so in intellection the will can focus on and enjoy something other than what the intellect directly presents, and thus redirect the intellect (Opus Oxoniense II, dist. 42, qq1-4, nn. 10-11). The moral importance of this is that the will can turn aside from what the intellect presents as good and pursue something else (although   that something else must be good in some respect). Second, he insists that in addition to being able to will or “nil” (velle or nolle), the will always retains the option simply to refrain from willing (non velle). This is important, for Scotus takes it that if we necessarily will something, we are not free. Scotus allows that the will is unable to nil beatitude, but holds that it can refrain from willing it, and so remains free (Ordinatio IV, suppl., dist. 49, qq9-10). This points up an important difference between his account and that of an intellectualist like Aquinas, who maintains that when the intellect has perfect vision of a perfect good (as it does only in the beatific vision), the intellect sees it as good, and the will adheres to that good, both from natural necessity. Scotus denies the necessity of willing the good presented by the intellect even here. The third point concerns his adoption of Anselm’s notion of the two affections of the will (which itself draws on Augustine’s account of the two loves of the will). The will’s tendency toward the agent’s perfection is called the affectio commodi, the natural appetite of the will that prohibits us from nilling perfection. It is similar to the will, simply, as it is understood by eudaimonist thinkers like Aquinas. See (Williams 1995) for an argument that it is identical to the will so understood; see (Toner 2005) for an argument that it is not. But it does not exhaust the will for Scotus, nor does it necessitate the willing of happiness, due to the affectio iustitiae, the tendency of the will to love things in accordance with their goodness, and not simply as means to or constituents of our own happiness. It is this affection, for Scotus, that grants the will its “native liberty.”

It also renders his account of practical reason more complicated, for now we see two distinct ways in which reason can present something as good to the will: First, something may be judged to be conducive to our happiness or perfection as rational agents (attracting the affectio commodi); second, something may be judged to be morally good or right or just (appealing to the affectio iustitiae). Thus, we can reason about how to attain happiness, or how to act justly. And although these will come together in our final union with God, they are always formally distinct and will often pull apart in this life. There is a hint here of what Sidgwick would much later call a dualism of practical reason, a dualism which in various forms characterizes most modern moral systems, Kantian or utilitarian.  Scotus’ response to this situation also anticipates modern moral thinking (see Toner on this)—the pursuit of happiness must be moderated by justice; as Scotus puts it, the affection for justice acts as a “checkrein” (moderatrix) on the affection for happiness (Ordinatio II, dist. 6, q2). If the pursuit is not so moderated, it will be bad or at best morally indifferent. A crucial, and characteristically voluntarist, implication follows: Once the intellect has judged an act to be good (in either broad sense), the will remains free to follow the judgment or not, according to which affection it acts on. It may refuse to pursue a good conducive to happiness because doing so conflicts with a requirement of justice; it may turn from a good required by justice in order to pursue happiness instead (in the Ordinatio passage just cited, Scotus accounts for the sin of the angels along these lines). For better or worse, depending upon what one takes freedom to involve, Aquinas’s moderately intellectualist view that reason and will concur in free choice has been replaced by the voluntarist view that once reason has done its work, the will must independently make its free choice.

Here we touch on a controversial area. None of the voluntarists held that reason could be dispensed with, or was unimportant. At the least, reason must present options (and recommendations) to the will for it to be able to choose. Henry of Ghent had maintained that this was the extent of reason’s contribution to free choice (that it was merely a causa sine qua non—a necessary pre-condition of willing, but not properly a cause of it). Scotus at one point held a more moderate view, that reason served as a partial efficient cause of willing. Some Scotus scholars argue that he later moved further in the voluntarist direction, coming to accept something close to Henry’s view (or at least acknowledging it as an account just as persuasive as his own earlier view; see (Dumont 2001) for a detailed discussion). Whatever the correct view of  Scotus’ mature position, however, the point about the will’s independence from reason should not be taken to be a denial of reason’s important role leading up to choice.

It would be an even greater mistake to think that, because Scotus is a voluntarist, he downplays reason’s contribution to choosing morally good actions. In fact, Scotus insists as firmly as Aquinas that to be morally good, an action must be willed in accordance with right reason (Quodlibet, q18). What does this involve for Scotus?

b.  Synderesis, Conscience, and the Natural Law

Scotus follows tradition in invoking the notions of synderesis and conscience (Ordinatio II, dist. 39): Conscience is the habit of drawing the right conclusions about what is to be done by means of the practical syllogism. As such it depends upon knowledge of the first principles of practical reason, and synderesis is the habit of knowing these. What are they? Like Aquinas, Scotus takes them to be precepts of the natural law, but his handling of these precepts is quite different. His treatment of natural law makes no reference to natural inclinations—instead of being articulations of the directedness of human nature, the precepts are rules that are self-evident to reason because their denials lead to contradictions. For example, since good is the object of love and God is infinite goodness itself, the first principle of practical reason is that God is to be loved or, most strictly, God is not to be hated (Ordinatio III, suppl., dist. 37), for “goodness itself is to be hated” is self-contradictory. Scotus also relates the natural law to the Decalogue, and holds that from this first principle we may conclude that the precepts of the First Table (relating to God) follow and belong to the natural law strictly speaking. The precepts of the Second Table (relating to neighbor), however, belong to the natural law only broadly speaking—they are consonant with the principles known to be true analytically, but do not follow from them necessarily. In this passage, Scotus also distinguishes the precepts of the First and Second Tables, the precepts that belong to the natural law strictly and only broadly speaking, as follows: It is, in the abstract, possible for us to attain our final end of loving God without following the precepts of the Second Table (although not in the concrete, given that God actually has issued these commands), but is absolutely impossible for us to attain it while disobeying the precepts of the First. Thus, practical reason by itself is sufficient to tell us that if God exists, we must not hate Him, must have no other gods before Him. Scotus does not think we are left with theoretical possibilities and unaided practical reason—we know from Revelation that God has ordained the precepts of the Second Table, which are thus binding (for having been commanded, they move beyond being merely consonant with the love of God). Still, strictly speaking they are contingent and could be set aside or altered by God’s absolute power. Indeed Scotus thinks that in certain cases God has actually dispensed from them (see Ordinatio III, suppl., dist. 37; there is dispute among scholars as to how malleable the content of moral principles concerning love of neighbor is, and how open to rational investigation; see for example Wolter, Williams 1995, and Mohle’s contribution to Williams 2003).

To illustrate the relationship of consonance, Scotus gives us an example of the analogous relationship in positive law between “the principle of positive law,” that life in community should be peaceful, and secondary legal principles concerning private property. The institution of private property is not absolutely required to preserve peace, but given the infirmities of human nature, the common holding of property is likely to result in dispute and neglect. Thus allowing people to have their own possessions is “exceedingly consonant with peaceful living.” Likewise, although failing to love one’s neighbor is not strictly inconsistent with loving God (nor rejecting precepts stated in the Second Table strictly inconsistent with loving one’s neighbor), there is a harmony or consonance at both points (between love of God and neighbor, and between love of neighbor and honoring these precepts), for God has created us as social creatures and the precepts of the Second Table are conducive to social life. Although Scotus is not explicit, we may surmise that the principle that life in community ought to be peaceful belongs to the natural law in this broad sense, as peaceful life with God’s other rational creatures seems “exceedingly consonant” with love of God. As we will see, Scotus does explicitly say elsewhere that the “Silver Rule” belongs to the law of nature (broadly speaking). Prohibitions against murder, adultery, false witness and so forth follow from these pretty clearly, by way of consonance if not strict logical necessity.

So right practical reason begins from the precepts of the natural law, but how does it move to the judgment of conscience? Let us look at a case of deciding what to say when asked about one’s role in a certain affair, perhaps when lying might keep the agent out of some trouble. Scotus takes it that reason can grasp the wrongness of lying on the following basis: The Silver Rule, “Do not do to others what you would not want them to do to you,” is not only a commandment but a law of nature, at least in the broad sense; no one would want to be deceived by his neighbor; therefore, …. (Ordinatio III, suppl., dist. 38). With this principle in hand, how is one to act? It will depend on the particulars of the situation. The agent should now know that he should not deceive, but should tell the truth (or perhaps remain silent, if, say, the person asking is a gossip with no real stake in the matter; let us assume such is not the case). This much is clear from reason’s grasp of the principle and its understanding of the agent himself as a rational being, the action as speaking to another rational being, and the object as telling the truth (Scotus gives an example with the agent under the description of (rational) animal, the action as eating, and the object as nourishing food; Quodlibet, q18). But practical reason still has work to do: It must discern the right manner in which to tell the truth (say, calmly and straightforwardly rather than aggressively or evasively), and the right time and place (later in private, rather than now in company, say). Most importantly, it must place the act in service of a “worthy purpose,” direct it to an appropriate end (one that is just rather than merely advantageous—for acts that proceed solely from the affectio commodi will not be fully in accordance with right reason, since they focus only on the value of their objects to the agent, ignoring what intrinsic value they may have—thus Scotus holds that they are at best morally indifferent).

c.  The Non-Teleological Character of Scotus’ Thought

Much of the detail above is similar to what Aquinas says about the moral goodness of action, which should not be surprising because both are drawing on Aristotle and Christian tradition, but there is an important difference as to the goodness of the ends of particular actions. Aquinas takes it that in intending, the will (and its proximate ends) should be ordered to the final end or highest good. This final end is the perfection of the agent, which itself consists in the right relation to God. In principle, the agent could articulate this ordering as a series of syllogisms in which practical reason clarified the way the pursuit of this proximate end is linked to the pursuit of the agent’s final end as set by her nature as a rational creature. A metaphorical way of putting this: Actions can be seen as episodes in a story that the agent, by means of her practical reason, is writing (or co-authoring, given God’s providential role). In the well-written story (the practically rational life blessed by grace), the episodes successfully lead up to the happy ending, in which the agent is united with her true love and, quite literally, lives happily ever after.

For Scotus, this teleological character largely (though not entirely) disappears. Actions must still be related to God, whom Scotus is happy to refer to as our final end. But now God in a way serves less as final end than as first cause, in the sense of author of the moral law or of dispensations from it; God is not so much sought after as an end, as honored and obeyed as source. At least in those actions that have creatures as their object (that is, most actions we perform in this life)—and which are therefore only contingently related to our attainment of God as our final end—practical reason does not identify the right way to act by discerning how the prospective actions contribute to a series leading up to the right relation to God (it does not construct a series of syllogisms in the way just mentioned). Instead, each prospective action is judged separately, as to whether it honors God appropriately, expresses love of God and obeys His commands (although such thoughts need not be always present in the agent’s mind). Actions may still be teleologically ordered, for a number of actions may be ordered to the accomplishment of a moral end. But it is no longer the case that all actions and their ends must be organized into a pattern or narrative completed only in the agent’s attainment of her final end, and that they can be fully assessed only in light of their place in such a pattern. Instead, each action (or course of action) stands alone as a complete work, and the ends of actions may be judged in light of their fit with the situation and their accord or discord with precepts of the natural law or other authoritative source (revealed commands, a divine dispensation). Picking up the author metaphor again, life is not so much a novel as a collection of epigrams and short stories, dedicated with love to God. This deep difference between Aquinas and Scotus is reflected in—indeed is a consequence of—their different formulations of the first principle of practical reason: “Good is to be done and pursued, and evil avoided” (Aquinas); “God is to be loved, and never hated” (Scotus). The one focuses on pursuit of the good (relationship with God); the other on the expression of love for God.

Related to this is  Scotus’ reduced role for the moral virtues: He holds that prudence can exist without moral virtue, that as free we always have what we need to do the right action here and now; it need not be part of a larger pattern involving the development of character (Ordinatio III, suppl., dist. 36). Yet, Scotus has no wish to deny that the virtues are important: they can help turn the will from evil (the willing of which can blind the intellect to the truth by turning it away for a time), can help facilitate the will’s choosing in accordance with the right judgment of prudence, and can also help the act to be done in the right manner. Moral virtue assists us, then, both in reasoning about action and in making that reasoning effectively practical, but it is not essential to performing morally good actions.

d.  Note on Ockham

Now it is perhaps these non-teleological aspects of  Scotus’ thought, more than any other, that mark him out as a transitional figure. It is thus worth noting that it is concerning this feature of his thought that some of the disputes mentioned above are taking place. Williams (1995) and MacIntyre (1990) stress the role of obligation and divine commands in his theory; Hare and Ingham stress instead the role of love and the goal of relationship with God—views perhaps susceptible of some kind of teleological interpretation after all. However in the end Scotus should be read on this, it does seem fair to say, at the least, that divine commands, and the related notions of obligation and obedience, play a more prominent role in his thinking than they do in that of Aquinas.

And in any event, the later Franciscan William of Ockham will leave little doubt that he is a divine command theorist (but, see Osborne and the noted selections in Spade for a recent exchange on this). This does not mean that he is not concerned with practical reason; he still insists that the morally good action is the one dictated by right reason and willed because so dictated (Quodlibet IIIq15). But practical reason now operates within the framework of God’s ordained power, wholly constructed by God’s sovereign will. Knowledge of what God’s power has actually ordained, and thus of how we should act, is now even more dependent upon revelation; God could, by his absolute power, command us even to hate him, and it would then be right for us to do so. Here we have moved from  Scotus’ moderate voluntarism to an extreme form in which morality consists in the obligation impressed by the commanding divine will upon the obedient (or otherwise) human will, and in which practical reason serves merely to help articulate what has been commanded and how to carry it out. The prevailing order, for Ockham, is one in which familiar concepts have application (prudence, the moral virtues, the Decalogue), but the radical contingency hanging about the whole is novel.

4.  Medieval and Modern

This section briefly examines the influence of these two theorists on contemporary practical reasoning theory, and also explores the relation between their views of practical reason and some common positions in current debates (those between Generalists and Particularists, and between Internalists and Externalists).

a.  The Current Influence of Aquinas and Scotus

The two figures focused on above are the two who seem most relevant to contemporary theorizing about practical reason. Aquinas’s influence is widespread: In Anglophonic moral philosophy Alasdair MacIntyre is perhaps the best-known among his many followers, developing Aquinas’s thought in ways more sensitive to the context of culture and tradition. Candace Vogler develops a broadly Thomistic theory of practical reason, exploring both his account of the capital vices and his division of the good into befitting, pleasurable, and useful (See (Toner 2005) for a short look at this division, and (Vogler 2002) for a very thorough treatment), concluding that in an atheistic context, it will be reasonable for some agents to be vicious. In general, the relevance of Aquinas’s thought as a development of Aristotle makes him a likely source for anyone working on practical reasoning or moral theory in this tradition, a fact not missed by some prominent moral theorists, most notably Philippa Foot and Rosalind Hursthouse. As for Scotus, his affinity with, and likely indirect influence upon, Kant, has been remarked by friends and foes alike (Williams and MacIntyre, for example). His direct influence on current thinking has not been great, but if the continuing progress on the critical edition of his works and the proliferation of Scotus scholarship are any indication, this may be beginning to change. In mainstream English philosophy, John Hare is perhaps the most prominent theorist so far to develop positions deeply indebted to Scotus.  Scotus’ combination within his moral theory of deontological and virtue elements should make his thinking of interest to Kantian or other deontological theorists intent on appropriating broadly Aristotelian notions of virtue. Also, his subtle treatment of the relations between reason, divine and human freedom, and the absolute and ordained powers of God, should make him of great interest to contemporary divine command theorists (Hare provides one example of this).

b. The Medievals and Particularism

Turning to the first of the current debates concerning practical reason: Let generalism be the view that the presence of some features of action (say that it causes pleasure, or is unkind) always tends to make the action right (or wrong)—such features have invariable “deontic valence.” This may come in forms “thin” (some natural features of action, say conduciveness to pleasure, always have a positive valence) or “thick” (while there are no such natural features, there are certain thick features, like kindness or fairness or spitefulness, that have invariable valence). Particularism, then, is the denial of this. We may speak of thin or thick forms particularism, being denials of the corresponding forms of generalism (one may, then, be at the same time a thick generalist and thin particularist). Where do the medievals fall along this spectrum? They tend toward thick generalism, indeed, we might say toward thick absolutism, a form of generalism maintaining that there are some features of action that not only tend to make an action right or wrong, but always succeed in doing so. For Aquinas, for example, the fact that any action was vicious, or violated any precept of the natural law, would make it wrong. This is thick rather than thin generalism because the precepts have evaluative content that cannot be reduced to merely “natural” or thin terms (for example, while the precept against murder is certainly not just the claim that “wrongful killing is wrong,” it is the claim that “intentional killing of the innocent is wrong,” and “innocence” cannot be reduced to thin, non-evaluative language). For Scotus, things look quite similar, within the framework of God’s ordained power. But because dispensations are possible by God’s absolute power, the features picked out by natural law precepts relevant to the Second Table are not of invariable valence (that Isaac was innocent may actually tend to make sacrificing him right, given God’s command to Abraham). Still, there are some absolutes for Scotus, those pertaining to the love of God in the First Table. Ockham comes the closest to particularism, leaving just one feature of actions that has invariably positive valence, its having been commanded by God. Ockham also maintains that, when possible, loving God above all things is always right, subtly reconciling this with his claim that God could command us not to love Him (on the grounds that given such a command it would be impossible to love Him above all things; see Quodlibet IIIq14).

c. The Medievals and Internalism

Let us turn to reasons for action and their connection to motivation. Internalism comes in many forms, but common to them is the claim that if an agent has a reason to do some action A, she also has a motive to A (the denial of this—the assertion that an agent may have a reason to A but have no motive to A—is called “externalism”). One characteristic form of internalism, often referred to as “Humean,” is the claim that if R is a reason for S to do A, then A must serve some desire that S actually has. The medievals were not internalists in this sense. A Thomistic agent, for example, has a reason to pursue a good perfective of him even if he has no desire for it at present. But, does not the agent have another desire the good serves, namely for perfection? Actually no. It is the will that naturally aims at what is perfective of the agent, and the will is a power, not a standing desire. But the will is naturally inclined to pursue such goods, so perhaps a modified internalism, that cited not just actual but also counterfactual desires (the agent would desire it if suitably informed and so forth)? Perhaps so, but details aside, there is one more critical qualification to make: Although internalism strictly requires only a connection between reason and motivation, it is usually also held that the latter has priority, that the explanatory direction is from desire to reason for action. For Aquinas, the direction is instead from reason to desire (the various acts of reason serving as the formal causes of the corresponding acts of will). Allowing for this, and given careful specifications of the counterfactual conditions, Aquinas and other intellectualists could probably be brought under some fold or other of the big tent of internalism.

For Scotus and other (sometimes more thoroughgoing) voluntarists, things are harder to see. The relation between intellect and will is looser, but still it is not held that the will’s desiring something can create a reason for the agent to act; instead, reason serves as a sort of necessary condition of the will’s act of desire (as mentioned above, perhaps a partial efficient cause as Scotus held at one point, perhaps as a causa sine qua non as Henry of Ghent held and—some argue—Scotus later held). If the will is the total cause of its own willing, or at least the primary cause, it can refrain from willing in accordance with the judgment presented by right practical reason (recall  Scotus’ point about non velle). Scotus even, following Anselm, performs a thought experiment concerning an angel created without the affectio iustitiae, maintaining that it could then only pursue its own happiness, and not what is intrinsically just. He does not explicitly say that it correctly identifies the right reasons for action, but given the independence of prudence from the moral virtues, it seems likely it could (“God is not to be hated” is, after all, supposed to be self-evidently true; and such an angel could understand the content of God’s revealed commands). If so, it could have reasons (not to hate God, not to commit or encourage lying or murder) with no corresponding desires (since it lacks the affectio iustitiae that would motivate it to follow these precepts even in cases in which doing so is not instrumental to its own happiness).

It is dangerous to sort philosophers according to distinctions they themselves do not have in mind (notice my hesitant language about Aquinas’s internalism above), but it seems that Scotus and other voluntarists would likely be externalists. This can be said more confidently—neither intellectualist nor voluntarist agents look much like the internalist and externalist agents one typically meets in the contemporary literature. But perhaps this is an advantage, for the medievals develop options largely ignored in much current discussion. And, it may be that the presence of more angels—falling, deformed, whole, and standing firm—would make for much livelier discussion.

5. Conclusion: Common Themes among the Medievals

So far this article has emphasized differences between the medieval accounts of practical reason, and their connections with some points in current theorizing. It is worth bringing out a few features that bring the medievals together while distinguishing them as a group from most current theorists. First, there is the shared Aristotelian and Augustinian heritage, already mentioned above. With this comes an agreement that our final end is the right relationship with God, a union with God by means of intellect and will. This is perfectly clear in intellectualists like Aquinas, but also holds for voluntarists. Scotus, for example, agrees that God is our final end; the initially open question is how to relate to Him: qua object of the affectio commodi (as the source of our perfection), or qua object of the affectio iustitiae (as perfect in Himself). And for all of the medievals, the good life consists in the successful attempt to achieve this union, to find, we might say, one’s proper place in Creation. In The City of God XIX.13, Augustine defines peace—our final end on his account—as the tranquillity of order, where order is the arrangement of things in which each finds its proper place in relation to the others, under God.

None of this is intended to paper over important differences, for example about just how to characterize that proper place, or whether the attempt to find it is best seen as a unified narrative or as a set of independent courses of action (whether life is a novel, we might say, or an anthology of short stories). It is intended only to stress the broad and important agreement underlying the differences in their accounts of practical reason. This is an agreement we should not find surprising given their shared belief, based on both philosophical argument and on faith, in a providential Creator, who is both Reason and Goodness. And it is an agreement whose importance we can recognize when we note that no medieval ever held that right practical reason could recommend an immoral course of action as, if Vogler is right, it can often do in an atheistic context.

6. References and Further Reason

a. Primary Sources

  • Anselm, On the Fall of the Devil, translated by Ralph McInerny in Anselm of Canterbury: The Major Works, edited by Brian Davies and Gillian Evans (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998).
  • Aristotle, The Nicomachean Ethics, translated by Terence Irwin (Indianapolis: Hackett Press, second edition 1999).
  • Aristotle, On the Soul, translated by J.A. Smith in The Complete Works of Aristotle, volume 1, edited by Jonathan Barnes (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984).
  • Aristotle, Metaphysics, translated by W.D. Ross in The Complete Works of Aristotle, volume 1, edited by Jonathan Barnes (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984).
  • Augustine, On Free Choice of the Will, translated by Thomas Williams (Indianapolis: Hackett Press, 1993).
  • Augustine, Confessions, translated by R.S. Pine-Coffin (London: Penguin Classics, 1961).
  • Augustine, The City of God against the Pagans, translated by R.W. Dyson (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998).
  • Henry of Ghent, Quodlibetal Questions on Free Will, translated by Roland Teske (Milwaukee: Marquette University Press, 1993).
  • Ockham (Occam), William of. Quodlibetal Questions, translated by Alfred Freddoso and Francis Kelley (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1998).
  • Scotus, John Duns. Duns Scotus on the Will and Morality, selections made and translated by Allan Wolter (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1997).
    • Many of  Scotus’ writings are divided in much the way described below for Aquinas. One further subdivision often included in works commenting on Peter Lombard’s Sentences (such as  Scotus’ Ordinatio), the distinctio, is noted as “dist.”
  • Thomas Aquinas, Summa theologiae, translated by the Fathers of the English Dominican Province (Allen, TX: Christian Classics, 1981).
    • This work is divided into three parts, with the second itself sub-divided into two parts. The parts are further broken up into questions, and the questions into articles. The articles themselves comprise objections to the position Aquinas will take, a claim “to the contrary,” Aquinas’s argument for his position, and replies to the objections. Parts are customarily referred to as follows: Ia, IIa, IIIa (from the Latin prima, secunda, and tertia); the parts of the second part as Ia-IIae and IIa-IIae (from prima secundae and secunda secundae—first of the second, second of the second). Questions are denoted simply by “q,” articles by “a,” and replies to objections by “ad” or toward. If not otherwise noted, the reference is to the body of the article or corpus (“c”), Aquinas’s argument for his position. So for instance, Ia-IIaeq13a1ad3 refers to the first part of the second part, question 13, article 1, reply to the third objection.
  • Thomas Aquinas, Commentary on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, translated by C.I. Litzinger (Notre Dame: Dumb Ox Books, 1993).

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bradley, Denis. Aquinas on the Twofold Human Good (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1997).
  • Cross, Richard. Duns Scotus (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999).
  • Dahl, Norman. Practical Reason, Aristotle, and Weakness of the Will (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1984).
  • Dumont, Stephen. “Did Duns Scotus Change His Mind on the Will?” in Nach der Verurteilung von 1277, edited by Jan Aersten, Kent Emery, and Andreas Speer (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 2001), 719-794.
  • Eardley, P.S. “Thomas Aquinas and Giles of Rome on the Will,” The Review of Metaphysics 56 (2003): 835-862.
  • Gallagher, David. “Thomas Aquinas on the Will as Rational Appetite,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 29 (1991), 559-584.
  • Hall, Pamela. Narrative and the Natural Law: An Interpretation of Thomistic Ethics (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1994).
  • Hare, John. “Scotus on Morality and Nature,” Medieval Philosophy and Theology 9 (2000), 15-38.
  • Hare, John. God’s Call (Grand Rapids: Eerdman’s, 2000).
  • Ingham, Mary Beth. “Duns Scotus, Morality and Happiness: A Reply to Thomas Williams,” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 74 (2000), 173-195.
  • Ingham, Mary Beth and Mechthild Dreyer. The Philosophical Vision of John Duns Scotus (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 2004).
  • Kent, Bonnie. Virtues of the Will (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1995).
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Whose Justice? Which Rationality? (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1988).
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1990).
  • MacDonald, Scott. “Ultimate Ends in Practical Reasoning: Aquinas’s Aristotelian Moral Psychology and Anscombe’s Fallacy,” The Philosophical Review 100 (1991): 31-65.
  • MacDonald, Scott and Eleonore Stump. (editors), Aquinas’s Moral Theory: Essays in Honor of Norman Kretzmann (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1999).
  • McCluskey, Colleen. “Worthy Constraints in Albertus Magnus’s Theory of Action,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 39 (2001): 491-533.
  • McCluskey, Colleen. “Medieval Theories of Free Will,” Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • McInerny, Ralph. Aquinas on Human Action (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1992).
  • Osborne, Thomas. “Ockham as a Divine-Command Theorist,” Religious Studies 41 (2005): 1-22.
  • Pinckaers, Servais. The Sources of Christian Ethics, translated by Sister Mary Thomas Noble (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1995).
  • Porter, Jean. Nature as Reason: A Thomistic Theory of the Natural Law (Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 2005).
  • Rist, John. Augustine: Ancient Thought Baptized (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996).
  • Spade, Paul Vincent. (editor), The Cambridge Companion to Ockham (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999).
    • See especially the essays by King and McCord Adams.
  • Toner, Christopher. “Angelic Sin in Aquinas and Scotus and the Genesis of Some Central Objections to Contemporary Virtue Ethics,” The Thomist 69 (2005): 79-125.
  • Vogler, Candace. Reasonably Vicious (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2002).
  • Westberg, Daniel. Right Practical Reason (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994).
  • Williams, Thomas. “How Scotus Separates Morality from Happiness,” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 69 (1995), 425-445.
  • Williams, Thomas. (editor), The Cambridge Companion to Duns Scotus (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003).
    • See especially the essays by Mohle, Williams, and Kent.
  • Wolter, Allan. “Native Freedom of the Will as a Key to the Ethics of Scotus” in The Philosophical Theology of John Duns Scotus, edited by Marilyn McCord Adams (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1990).

Author Information

Christopher Toner
University of St. Thomas
U. S. A.

Animals and Ethics

What place should non-human animals have in an acceptable moral system? These animals exist on the borderline of our moral concepts; the result is that we sometimes find ourselves according them a strong moral status, while at other times denying them any kind of moral status at all. For example, public outrage is strong when knowledge of "puppy mills" is made available; the thought here is that dogs deserve much more consideration than the operators of such places give them. However, when it is pointed out that the conditions in a factory farm are as bad as, if not much worse than, the conditions in a puppy mill, the usual response is that those affected are “just animals” after all, and do not merit our concern.  Philosophical thinking on the moral standing of animals is diverse and can be generally grouped into three general categories: Indirect theories, direct but unequal theories, and moral equality theories.

Indirect theories deny animals moral status or equal consideration with humans due to a lack of consciousness, reason, or autonomy.  Ultimately denying moral  status to animals, these theories may still require not harming animals, but only because doing so causes harm to a human being's morality.  Arguments in this category have been formulated by philosophers such as Immanuel Kant, René Descartes, Thomas Aquinas, Peter Carruthers, and various religious theories.

Direct but unequal theories accord some moral consideration to animals, but deny them a fuller moral status due to their inability to respect another agent's rights or display moral reciprocity within a community of equal agents. Arguments in this category consider the sentience of the animal as sufficient reason not to cause direct harm to animals.  However, where the interests of animals and humans conflict, the special properties of being human such as rationality, autonomy, and self-consciousness accord higher consideration to the interests of human beings.

Moral equality theories extend equal consideration and moral status to animals by refuting the supposed moral relevance of the aforementioned special properties of human beings.  Arguing by analogy, moral equality theories often extend the concept of rights to animals on the grounds that they have similar physiological and mental capacities as infants or disabled human beings.  Arguments in this category have been formulated by philosophers such as Peter Singer and Tom Regan.

Table of Contents

  1. Indirect Theories
    1. Worldview/Religious Theories
    2. Kantian Theories
    3. Cartesian Theories
    4. Contractualist Theories
    5. Implications for the Treatment of Animals
    6. Two Common Arguments Against Indirect Theories
      1. The Argument From Marginal Cases
      2. Problems with Indirect Duties to Animals
  2. Direct but Unequal Theories
    1. Why Animals have Direct Moral Status
    2. Why Animals are not Equal to Human Beings
      1. Only Human Beings Have Rights
      2. Only Human Beings are Rational, Autonomous, and Self-Conscious
      3. Only Human Beings Can Act Morally
      4. Only Human Beings are Part of the Moral Community
  3. Moral Equality Theories
    1. Singer and the Principle of Equal Consideration of Interests
      1. The Argument from Marginal Cases (Again)
      2. The Sophisticated Inegalitarian Argument
      3. Practical Implications
    2. Regan and Animal Rights
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Anthologies
    2. Monographs
    3. Articles

1. Indirect Theories

On indirect theories, animals do not warrant our moral concern on their own, but may warrant concern only in so far as they are appropriately related to human beings. The various kinds of indirect theories to be discussed are Worldview/Religious Theories, Kantian Theories, Cartesian Theories, and Contractualist Theories. The implications these sorts of theories have for the proper treatment of animals will be explored after that. Finally, two common methods of arguing against indirect theories will be discussed.

a. Worldview/Religious Theories

Some philosophers deny that animals warrant direct moral concern due to religious or philosophical theories of the nature of the world and the proper place of its inhabitants. One of the earliest and clearest expressions of this kind of view comes to us from Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.). According to Aristotle, there is a natural hierarchy of living beings. The different levels are determined by the abilities present in the beings due to their natures. While plants, animals, and human beings are all capable of taking in nutrition and growing, only animals and human beings are capable of conscious experience. This means that plants, being inferior to animals and human beings, have the function of serving the needs of animals and human beings. Likewise, human beings are superior to animals because human beings have the capacity for using reason to guide their conduct, while animals lack this ability and must instead rely on instinct. It follows, therefore, that the function of animals is to serve the needs of human beings. This, according to Aristotle, is "natural and expedient" (Regan and Singer, 1989: 4-5).

Following Aristotle, the Christian philosopher St. Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274) argues that since only beings that are rational are capable of determining their actions, they are the only beings towards which we should extend concern "for their own sakes" (Regan and Singer, 1989: 6-12). Aquinas believes that if a being cannot direct its own actions then others must do so; these sorts of beings are merely instruments. Instruments exist for the sake of people that use them, not for their own sake. Since animals cannot direct their own actions, they are merely instruments and exist for the sake of the human beings that direct their actions. Aquinas believes that his view follows from the fact that God is the last end of the universe, and that it is only by using the human intellect that one can gain knowledge and understanding of God. Since only human beings are capable of achieving this final end, all other beings exist for the sake of human beings and their achievement of this final end of the universe.

Remnants of these sorts of views remain in justifications for discounting the interests of animals on the basis of the food chain. On this line of thought, if one kind of being regularly eats another kind of being, then the first is said to be higher on the food chain. If one being is higher than another on the food chain, then it is natural for that being to use the other in the furtherance of its interests. Since this sort of behavior is natural, it does not require any further moral justification.

b. Kantian Theories

Closely related to Worldview/Religious theories are theories such as Immanuel Kant's (1724-1804). Kant developed a highly influential moral theory according to which autonomy is a necessary property to be the kind of being whose interests are to count direclty in the moral assessment of actions (Kant, 1983, 1956). According to Kant, morally permissible actions are those actions that could be willed by all rational individuals in the circumstances. The important part of his conception for the moral status of animals is his reliance on the notion of willing. While both animals and human beings have desires that can compel them to action, only human beings are capable of standing back from their desires and choosing which course of action to take. This ability is manifested by our wills. Since animals lack this ability, they lack a will, and therefore are not autonomous. According to Kant, the only thing with any intrinsic value is a good will. Since animals have no wills at all, they cannot have good wills; they therefore do not have any intrinsic value.

Kant's theory goes beyond the Worldview/Religious theories by relying on more general philosophical arguments about the nature of morality. Rather than simply relying on the fact that it is "natural" for rational and autonomous beings to use non-rational beings as they see fit, Kant instead provides an argument for the relevance of rationality and autonomy. A theory is a Kantian theory, then, if it provides an account of the properties that human beings have and animals lack that warrants our according human beings a very strong moral status while denying animals any kind of moral status at all. Kant's own theory focused on the value of autonomy; other Kantian theories focus on such properties as being a moral agent, being able to exist in a reciprocal relation with other human beings, being able to speak, or being self-aware.

c. Cartesian Theories

Another reason to deny that animals deserve direct concern arises from the belief that animals are not conscious, and therefore have no interests or well-being to take into consideration when considering the effects of our actions. Someone that holds this position might agree that if animals were conscious then we would be required to consider their interests to be directly relevant to the assessment of actions that affect them. However, since they lack a welfare, there is nothing to take directly into account when acting.

One of the clearest and most forceful denials of animal consciousness is developed by Rene Descartes (1596-1650), who argues that animals are automata that might act as if they are conscious, but really are not so (Regan and Singer, 1989: 13-19). Writing during the time when a mechanistic view of the natural world was replacing the Aristotelian conception, Descartes believed that all of animal behavior could be explained in purely mechanistic terms, and that no reference to conscious episodes was required for such an explanation. Relying on the principle of parsimony in scientific explanation (commonly referred to as Occam's Razor) Descartes preferred to explain animal behavior by relying on the simplest possible explanation of their behavior. Since it is possible to explain animal behavior without reference to inner episodes of awareness, doing so is simpler than relying on the assumption that animals are conscious, and is therefore the preferred explanation.

Descartes anticipates the response that his reasoning, if applicable to animal behavior, should apply equally well to human behavior. The mechanistic explanation of behavior does not apply to human beings, according to Descartes, for two reasons. First, human beings are capable of complex and novel behavior. This behavior is not the result of simple responses to stimuli, but is instead the result of our reasoning about the world as we perceive it. Second, human beings are capable of the kind of speech that expresses thoughts. Descartes was aware that some animals make sounds that might be thought to constitute speech, such as a parrot's "request" for food, but argued that these utterances are mere mechanically induced behaviors. Only human beings can engage in the kind of speech that is spontaneous and expresses thoughts.

Descartes' position on these matters was largely influenced by his philosophy of mind and ontology. According to Descartes, there are two mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive kinds of entities or properties: material or physical entities on the one hand, and mental entities on the other. Although all people are closely associated with physical bodies, they are not identical with their bodies. Rather, they are identical with their souls, or the immaterial, mental substance that constitutes their consciousness. Descartes believed that both the complexity of human behavior and human speech requires the positing of such an immaterial substance in order to be explained. However, animal behavior does not require this kind of assumption; besides, Descartes argued, "it is more probable that worms and flies and caterpillars move mechanically than that they all have immortal souls" (Regan and Singer, 1989: 18).

More recently, arguments against animal consciousness have been resurfacing. One method of arguing against the claim that animals are conscious is to point to the flaws of arguments purporting to claim that animals are conscious. For example, Peter Harrison has recently argued that the Argument from Analogy, one of the most common arguments for the claim that animals are conscious, is hopelessly flawed (Harrison, 1991). The Argument from Analogy relies on the similarities between animals and human beings in order to support the claim that animals are conscious. The similarities usually cited by proponents of this argument are similarities in behavior, similarities in physical structures, and similarities in relative positions on the evolutionary scale. In other words, both human beings and animals respond in the same way when confronted with "pain stimuli"; both animals and human beings have brains, nerves, neurons, endorphins, and other structures; and both human beings and animals are relatively close to each other on the evolutionary scale. Since they are similar to each other in these ways, we have good reason to believe that animals are conscious, just as are human beings.

Harrison attacks these points one by one. He points out that so-called pain-behavior is neither necessary nor sufficient for the experience of pain. It is not necessary because the best policy in some instances might be to not show that you are in pain. It is not sufficient since amoebas engage in pain behavior, but we do not believe that they can feel pain. Likewise, we could easily program robots to engage in pain-behavior, but we would not conclude that they feel pain. The similarity of animal and human physical structures is inconclusive because we have no idea how, or even if, the physical structure of human beings gives rise to experiences in the first place. Evolutionary considerations are not conclusive either, because it is only pain behavior, and not the experience of pain itself, that would be advantageous in the struggle for survival. Harrison concludes that since the strongest argument for the claim that animals are conscious fails, we should not believe that they are conscious.

Peter Carruthers has suggested that there is another reason to doubt that animals are conscious Carruthers, 1989, 1992). Carruthers begins by noting that not all human experiences are conscious experiences. For example, I may be thinking of an upcoming conference while driving and not ever consciously "see" the truck in the road that I swerve to avoid. Likewise, patients that suffer from "blindsight" in part of their visual field have no conscious experience of seeing anything in that part of the field. However, there must be some kind of experience in both of these cases since I did swerve to avoid the truck, and must have "seen" it, and because blindsight patients can catch objects that are thrown at them in the blindsighted area with a relatively high frequency. Carruthers then notes that the difference between conscious and non-conscious experiences is that conscious experiences are available to higher-order thoughts while non-conscious experiences are not. (A higher-order thought is a thought that can take as its object another thought.) He thus concludes that in order to have conscious experiences one must be able to have higher-order thoughts. However, we have no reason to believe that animals have higher-order thoughts, and thus no reason to believe that they are conscious.

d. Contractualist Theories

Contractualist Theories of morality construe morality to be the set of rules that rational individuals would choose under certain specified conditions to govern their behavior in society. These theories have had a long and varied history; however, the relationship between contractualism and animals was not really explored until after John Rawls published his A Theory of Justice. In that work, Rawls argues for a conception of justice as fairness. Arguing against Utilitarian theories of justice, Rawls believes that the best conception of a just society is one in which the rules governing that society are rules that would be chosen by individuals from behind a veil of ignorance. The veil of ignorance is a hypothetical situation in which individuals do not know any particular details about themselves, such as their sex, age, race, intelligence, abilities, etc. However, these individuals do know general facts about human society, such as facts about psychology, economics, human motivation, etc. Rawls has his imagined contractors be largely self-interested; each person's goal is to select the rules that will benefit them the most. Since they do not know who exactly they are, they will not choose rules that benefit any one individual, or segment of society, over another (since they may find themselves to be in the harmed group). Instead, they will choose rules that protect, first and foremost, rational, autonomous individuals.

Although Rawls argues for this conception as a conception of justice, others have tried to extend it to cover all of morality. For example, in The Animals Issue, Peter Carruthers argues for a conception of morality that is based largely on Rawls's work. Carruthers notes that if we do so extend Rawls's conception, animals will have no direct moral standing. Since the contractors are self-interested, but do not know who they are, they will accept rules that protect rational individuals. However, the contractors know enough about themselves to know that they are not animals. They will not adopt rules that give special protection to animals, therefore, since this would not further their self-interest. The result is that rational human beings will be directly protected, while animals will not.

e. Implications for the Treatment of Animals

If indirect theories are correct, then we are not required to take the interests of animals to be directly relevant to the assessment of our actions when we are deciding how to act. This does not mean, however, that we are not required to consider how our actions will affect animals at all. Just because something is not directly morally considerable does not imply that we can do whatever we want to it. For example, there are two straightforward ways in which restrictions regarding the proper treatment of animals can come into existence. Consider the duties we have towards private property. I cannot destroy your car if I desire to do so because it is your property, and by harming it I will thereby harm you. Also, I cannot go to the town square and destroy an old tree for fun since this may upset many people that care for the tree.

Likewise, duties with regard to animals can exist for these reasons. I cannot harm your pets because they belong to you, and by harming them I will thereby harm you. I also cannot harm animals in public simply for fun since doing so will upset many people, and I have a duty to not cause people undue distress. These are two straightforward ways in which indirect theories will generate duties with regard to animals.

There are two other ways that even stronger restrictions regarding the proper treatment of animals might be generated from indirect theories. First, both Immanuel Kant and Peter Carruthers argue that there can be more extensive indirect duties to animals. These duties extend not simply to the duty to refrain from harming the property of others and the duty to not offend animal lovers. Rather, we also have a duty to refrain from being cruel to them. Kant argues:

Our duties towards animals are merely indirect duties towards humanity. Animal nature has analogies to human nature, and by doing our duties to animals in respect of manifestations of human nature, we indirectly do our duty to humanity…. We can judge the heart of a man by his treatment of animals (Regan and Singer, 1989: 23-24).

Likewise, Carruthers writes:

Such acts [as torturing a cat for fun] are wrong because they are cruel. They betray an indifference to suffering that may manifest itself…with that person's dealings with other rational agents. So although the action may not infringe any rights…it remains wrong independently of its effect on any animal lover (Carruthers, 1992: 153-54).

So although we need not consider how our actions affect animals themselves, we do need to consider how our treatment of animals will affect our treatment of other human beings. If being cruel to an animal will make us more likely to be cruel to other human beings, we ought not be cruel to animals; if being grateful to animal will help us in being grateful to human beings then we ought to be grateful to animals.

Second, there may be an argument for vegetarianism that does not rely on considerations of the welfare of animals at all. Consider that for every pound of protein that we get from an animal source, we must feed the animals, on average, twenty-three pounds of vegetable protein. Many people on the planet today are dying of easily treatable diseases largely due to a diet that is below starvation levels. If it is possible to demonstrate that we have a duty to help alleviate the suffering of these human beings, then one possible way of achieving this duty is by refraining from eating meat. The vegetable protein that is used to feed the animals that wealthy countries eat could instead be used to feed the human beings that live in such deplorable conditions.

Of course, not all indirect theorists accept these results. However, the point to be stressed here is that even granting that animals have no direct moral status, we may have (possibly demanding) duties regarding their treatment.

f. Two Common Arguments Against Indirect Theories

Two common arguments against indirect theories have seemed compelling to many people. The first argument is The Argument from Marginal Cases; the second is an argument against the Kantian account of indirect duties to animals.

i. The Argument From Marginal Cases

The Argument from Marginal Cases is an argument that attempts to demonstrate that if animals do not have direct moral status, then neither do such human beings as infants, the senile, the severely cognitively disabled, and other such "marginal cases" of humanity. Since we believe that these sorts of human beings do have direct moral status, there must be something wrong with any theory that claims they do not. More formally, the argument is structured as follows:

  1. If we are justified in denying direct moral status to animals then we are justified in denying direct moral status to the marginal cases.
  2. We are not justified in denying direct moral status to the marginal cases.
  3. Therefore we are not justified denying direct moral status to animals.

The defense of premise (1) usually goes something like this. If being rational (or autonomous, or able to speak) is what permits us to deny direct moral status to animals, then we can likewise deny that status to any human that is not rational (or autonomous, able to speak, etc.). This line of reasoning works for almost every property that has been thought to warrant our denying direct moral status to animals. Since the marginal cases are beings whose abilities are equal to, if not less than, the abilities of animals, any reason to keep animals out of the class of beings with direct moral status will keep the marginal cases out as well.

There is one property that is immune to this line of argument, namely, the property of being human. Some who adhere to Worldview/Religious Views might reject this argument and maintain instead that it is simply "natural" for human beings to be above animals on any moral scale. However, if someone does so they must give up the claim that human beings are above animals due to the fact that human beings are more intelligent or rational than animals. It must be claimed instead that being human is, in itself, a morally relevant property. Few in recent times are willing to make that kind of a claim.

Another way to escape this line of argument is to deny the second premise (Cf. Frey, 1980; Francis and Norman, 1978). This may be done in a series of steps. First, it may be noted that there are very few human beings that are truly marginal. For example, infants, although not currently rational, have the potential to become rational. Perhaps they should not be counted as marginal for that reason. Likewise, the senile may have a direct moral status due to the desires they had when they were younger and rational. Once the actual number of marginal cases is appreciated, it is then claimed that it is not counter-intuitive to conclude that the remaining individuals do not have a direct moral status after all. Once again, however, few are willing to accept that conclusion. The fact that a severely cognitively disabled infant can feel pain seems to most to be a reason to refrain from harming the infant.

ii. Problems with Indirect Duties to Animals

Another argument against indirect theories begins with the intuition that there are some things that simply cannot be done to animals. For example, I am not permitted to torture my own cat for fun, even if no one else finds out about it. This intuition is one that any acceptable moral theory must be able to accommodate. The argument against indirect theories is that they cannot accommodate this intuition in a satisfying way.

Both Kant and Carruthers agree that my torturing my own cat for fun would be wrong. However, they believe it is wrong not because of the harm to the cat, but rather because of the effect this act will have on me. Many people have found this to be a very unsatisfying account of the duty. Robert Nozick labels the bad effects of such an act moral spillover, and asks:

Why should there be such a spillover? If it is, in itself, perfectly all right to do anything at all to animals for any reason whatsoever, then provided a person realizes the clear line between animals and persons and keeps it in mind as he acts, why should killing animals brutalize him and make him more likely to harm or kill persons (Nozick, 1974: 36)?

In other words, unless it is wrong in itself to harm the animal, it is hard to see why such an act would lead people to do other acts that are likewise wrong. If the indirect theorist does not have a better explanation for why it is wrong to torture a cat for fun, and as long as we firmly believe such actions are wrong, then we will be forced to admit that indirect theories are not acceptable.

Indirect theorists can, and have, responded to this line of argument in three ways. First, they could reject the claim that the indirect theorist's explanation of the duty is unsatisfactory. Second, they could offer an alternative explanation for why such actions as torturing a cat are wrong. Third, they could reject the claim that those sorts of acts are necessarily wrong.

2. Direct but Unequal Theories

Most people accept an account of the proper moral status of animals according to which the interests of animals count directly in the assessment of actions that affect them, but do not count for as much as the interests of human beings. Their defense requires two parts: a defense of the claim that the interests of animals count directly in the assessment of actions that affect them, and a defense of the claim that the interests of animals do not count for as much as the interests of human beings.

a. Why Animals have Direct Moral Status

The argument in support of the claim that animals have direct moral status is rather simple. It goes as follows:

  1. If a being is sentient then it has direct moral status.
  2. (Most) animals are sentient
  3. Therefore (most) animals have direct moral status.

"Sentience" refers to the capacity to experience episodes of positively or negatively valenced awareness. Examples of positively valenced episodes of awareness are pleasure, joy, elation, and contentment. Examples of negatively valenced episodes of awareness are pain, suffering, depression, and anxiety.

In support of premise (1), many argue that pain and pleasure are directly morally relevant, and that there is no reason to discount completely the pleasure or pain of any being. The argument from analogy is often used in support of premise (2) (see the discussion of this argument in section I, part C above). The argument from analogy is also used in answering the difficult question of exactly which animals are sentient. The general idea is that the justification for attributing sentience to a being grows stronger the more analogous it is to human beings.

People also commonly use the flaws of indirect theories as a reason to support the claim that animals have direct moral status. Those that believe both that the marginal cases have direct moral status and that indirect theories cannot answer the challenge of the Argument from Marginal Cases are led to support direct theories; those that believe both that such actions as the torture of one's own cat for fun are wrong and that indirect theories cannot explain why they are wrong are also led to direct theories.

b. Why Animals are not Equal to Human Beings

The usual manner of justifying the claim that animals are not equal to human beings is to point out that only humans have some property, and then argue that that property is what confers a full and equal moral status to human beings. Some philosophers have used the following claims on this strategy: (1) only human beings have rights; (2) only human beings are rational, autonomous, and self-conscious; (3) only human beings are able to act morally; and (4) only human beings are part of the moral community.

i. Only Human Beings Have Rights

On one common understanding of rights, only human beings have rights. On this conception of rights, if a being has a right then others have a duty to refrain from infringing that right; rights entail duties. An individual that has a right to something must be able to claim that thing for himself, where this entails being able to represent himself in his pursuit of the thing as a being that is legitimately pursuing the furtherance of his interests (Cf. McCloskey, 1979). Since animals are not capable of representing themselves in this way, they cannot have rights.

However, lacking rights does not entail lacking direct moral status; although rights entail duties it does not follow that duties entail rights. So although animals may have no rights, we may still have duties to them. The significance of having a right, however, is that rights act as "trumps" against the pursuit of utility. In other words, if an individual has a right to something, we are not permitted to infringe on that right simply because doing so will have better overall results. Our duties to those without rights can be trumped by considerations of the overall good. Although I have a duty to refrain from destroying your property, that duty can be trumped if I must destroy the property in order to save a life. Likewise, I am not permitted to harm animals without good reason; however, if greater overall results will come about from such harm, then it is justified to harm animals. This sort of reasoning has been used to justify such practices as experimentation that uses animals, raising animals for food, and using animals for our entertainment in such places as rodeos and zoos.

There are two points of contention with the above account of rights. First, it has been claimed that if human beings have rights, then animals will likewise have rights. For example, Joel Feinberg has argued that all is required in order for a being to have a right is that the being be capable of being represented as legitimately pursuing the furtherance of its interests (Feinberg, 1974). The claim that the being must be able to represent itself is too strong, thinks Feinberg, for such a requirement will exclude infants, the senile, and other marginal cases from the class of beings with rights. In other words, Feinberg invokes yet another instance of the Argument from Marginal Cases in order to support his position.

Second, it has been claimed that the very idea of rights needs to be jettisoned. There are two reasons for this. First, philosophers such as R. G. Frey have questioned the legitimacy of the very idea of rights, echoing Bentham's famous claim that rights are "nonsense on stilts" (Frey, 1980). Second, philosophers have argued that whether or not a being will have rights will depend essentially on whether or not it has some other lower-order property. For example, on the above conception of rights, whether a being will have a right or not will depend on whether it is able to represent itself as a being that is legitimately pursuing the furtherance of its interests. If that is what grounds rights, then what is needed is a discussion of the moral importance of that ability, along with a defense of the claim that it is an ability that animals lack. More generally, it has been argued that if we wish to deny animals rights and claim that only human beings have them, then we must focus not so much on rights, but rather on what grounds them. For this reason, much of the recent literature concerning animals and ethics focuses not so much on rights, but rather on whether or not animals have certain other properties, and whether the possession of those properties is a necessary condition for equal consideration (Cf. DeGrazia, 1999).

ii. Only Human Beings are Rational, Autonomous, and Self-Conscious

Some people argue that only rational, autonomous, and self-conscious beings deserve full and equal moral status; since only human beings are rational, autonomous, and self-conscious, it follows that only human beings deserve full and equal moral status. Once again, it is not claimed that we can do whatever we like to animals; rather, the fact that animals are sentient gives us reason to avoid causing them unnecessary pain and suffering. However, when the interests of animals and human beings conflict we are required to give greater weight to the interests of human beings. This also has been used to justify such practices as experimentation on animals, raising animals for food, and using animals in such places as zoos and rodeos.

The attributes of rationality, autonomy, and self-consciousness confer a full and equal moral status to those that possess them because these beings are the only ones capable of attaining certain values and goods; these values and goods are of a kind that outweigh the kinds of values and goods that non-rational, non-autonomous, and non-self-conscious beings are capable of attaining. For example, in order to achieve the kind of dignity and self-respect that human beings have, a being must be able to conceive of itself as one among many, and must be able to choose his actions rather than be led by blind instinct (Cf. Francis and Norman, 1978; Steinbock, 1978). Furthermore, the values of appreciating art, literature, and the goods that come with deep personal relationships all require one to be rational, autonomous, and self-conscious. These values, and others like them, are the highest values to us; they are what make our lives worth living. As John Stuart Mill wrote, "Few human creatures would consent to be changed into any of the lower animals for a promise of the fullest allowance of a beast's pleasures" (Mill, 1979). We find the lives of beings that can experience these goods to be more valuable, and hence deserving of more protection, than the lives of beings that cannot.

iii. Only Human Beings Can Act Morally

Another reason for giving stronger preference to the interests of human beings is that only human beings can act morally. This is considered to be important because beings that can act morally are required to sacrifice their interests for the sake of others. It follows that those that do sacrifice their good for the sake of others are owed greater concern from those that benefit from such sacrifices. Since animals cannot act morally, they will not sacrifice their own good for the sake of others, but will rather pursue their good even at the expense of others. That is why human beings should give the interests of other human beings greater weight than they do the interests of animals.

iv. Only Human Beings are Part of the Moral Community

Finally, some claim that membership in the moral community is necessary for full and equal moral status. The moral community is not defined in terms of the intrinsic properties that beings have, but is defined rather in terms of the important social relations that exist between beings. For example, human beings can communicate with each other in meaningful ways, can engage in economic, political, and familial relationships with each other, and can also develop deep personal relationships with each other. These kinds of relationships require the members of such relationships to extend greater concern to other members of these relationships than they do to others in order for the relationships to continue. Since these relationships are what constitute our lives and the value contained in them, we are required to give greater weight to the interests of human beings than we do to animals.

3. Moral Equality Theories

The final theories to discuss are the moral equality theories. On these theories, not only do animals have direct moral status, but they also have the same moral status as human beings. According to theorists of this kind, there can be no legitimate reason to place human beings and animals in different moral categories, and so whatever grounds our duties to human beings will likewise ground duties to animals.

a. Singer and the Principle of Equal Consideration of Interests

Peter Singer has been very influential in the debate concerning animals and ethics. The publication of his Animal Liberation marked the beginning of a growing and increasingly powerful movement in both the United States and Europe.

Singer attacks the views of those who wish to give the interests of animals less weight than the interests of human beings. He argues that if we attempt to extend such unequal consideration to the interests of animals, we will be forced to give unequal consideration to the interests of different human beings. However, doing this goes against the intuitively plausible and commonly accepted claim that all human beings are equal. Singer concludes that we must instead extend a principle of equal consideration of interests to animals as well. Singer describes that principle as follows:

The essence of the Principle of Equal Consideration of Interests is that we give equal weight in our moral deliberations to the like i