Category Archives: Value Theory

John Rawls (1921—2002)

John RawlsJohn Rawls was arguably the most important political philosopher of the twentieth century. He wrote a series of highly influential articles in the 1950s and ’60s that helped refocus Anglo-American moral and political philosophy on substantive problems about what we ought to do. His first book, A Theory of Justice [TJ] (1971), revitalized the social-contract tradition, using it to articulate and defend a detailed vision of egalitarian liberalism. In Political Liberalism [PL] (1993), he recast the role of political philosophy, accommodating it to the effectively permanent “reasonable pluralism” of religious, philosophical, and other comprehensive doctrines or worldviews that characterize modern societies. He explains how philosophers can characterize public justification and the legitimate, democratic use of collective coercive power while accepting that pluralism.

Although most of this article will be devoted to TJ, the exposition of that work will take account of Political Liberalism and other later works of Rawls. TJ sets out and defends the principles of Justice as Fairness. Rawls takes the basic structure of society as his subject matter and utilitarianism as his principal opponent. Part One of TJ designs a social-contract-type thought experiment, the Original Position (OP), and argues that parties in the OP will prefer Justice as Fairness to utilitarianism and various other views. In order to understand the argument from the OP, one must pay special attention to the motivation of the parties to the OP, which is philosophically stipulated and provided with a Kantian interpretation. Part Two of TJ checks the fit between the principles of Justice as Fairness and our more concrete considered views about just institutions, thereby helping move us towards a reflective equilibrium that supports those principles. Part Three of TJ addresses the stability of a society organized around Justice as Fairness, arguing that there will be an important congruence in such a society between people’s views about justice and what they value. By the time he wrote Political Liberalism, however, Rawls had decided that an inconsistency in TJ called for recasting the argument for stability. In other ways, the argument of TJ rested on important simplifications, which had the effect of setting aside questions about international justice, disability, and familial justice. Rawls turned to these “problems of extension,” as he called them, at the end of his career.

Table of Contents

  1. Biographical Sketch
  2. Rawls's Mature Work: A Theory of Justice (1971)
    1. The Basic Structure of Society
    2. Utilitarianism as the Principal Opponent
    3. The Original Position
      1. The Conditions and Purpose of the Original Position
      2. The Motivations of the Parties to the Original Position
      3. Kantian Influence and Interpretation of the Original Position
    4. The Principles of Justice as Fairness
    5. The Argument from the Original Position
    6. Reflective Equilibrium
    7. Just Institutions
    8. Stability
    9. Congruence
  3. Recasting the Argument for Stability: Political Liberalism (1993)
  4. Problems of Extension
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Biographical Sketch

John Bordley Rawls was born and schooled in Baltimore, Maryland, USA. Although his family was of comfortable means, his youth was twice marked by tragedy. In two successive years, his two younger brothers contracted an infectious disease from him—diphtheria in one case and pneumonia in the other—and died. Rawls’s vivid sense of the arbitrariness of fortune may have stemmed in part from this early experience. His remaining, older brother attended Princeton for undergraduate studies and was a great athlete. Rawls followed his brother to Princeton. Although Rawls played baseball, he was, in later life at least, excessively modest about his success at that or at any other endeavor.

Rawls continued for his Ph.D. studies at Princeton and came under the influence of the first of a series of Wittgensteinean friends and mentors, Norman Malcolm. From them, he learned to avoid entanglement in metaphysical controversies when possible. Rawls’s doctoral dissertation (1950) already showed, however, that he would not be content to deconstruct our impulse to ask metaphysical questions; instead, he devoted himself to constructive philosophical tasks. Turning away from the then-influential program of attempting to analyze the meaning of the moral concepts, he replaced it with what was—for a philosopher—a more practically oriented task: that of characterizing a general method of moral decision making. Part of this dissertation work was the basis of his first published article, “Outline of a Decision Procedure for Ethics.” (1951). This was an early attempt to tackle the central question of Rawls’s mature theory: what sort of decision procedure can we imagine that would help us resolve disputed claims in a fair way?

Of equal significance to Rawls’s turn away from conceptual analysis and towards a more practical conception of moral philosophy was his encounter, during a year (1952-3) as a Fulbright Fellow in Oxford, with exciting, substantive work in legal and political philosophy, especially that of H.L.A. Hart and Isaiah Berlin. Hart had made progress in legal philosophy by connecting the idea of social practices with the institutions of the law. Rawls’s second published essay, “Two Concepts of Rules” (1955), uses a conception of social practices influenced by Hart to explore a kind of rule-utilitarianism. Compare TJ at 48n.. In Isaiah Berlin, Rawls met a brilliant historian of political thought—someone who, by his own account, had been driven away from philosophy by the aridity of mid-century conceptual analysis. Berlin influentially traced the historical careers of competing, large-scale values, such as liberty (which he distinguished as either negative or positive) and equality. Not long after his time in Oxford, Rawls embarked on what was to become a life-long project of finding a coherent and attractive way of combining freedom and equality into one conception of political justice. Cf. PL at 327. This project first took the form of a series of widely-discussed articles about justice published between 1958 and 1969.

After teaching at Cornell and MIT, Rawls took up a position in the philosophy department at Harvard in 1962. There he remained, being named a University Professor in 1979. Throughout his career, he devoted considerable attention to his teaching. In his lectures on moral and political philosophy, Rawls focused meticulously on great philosophers of the past—Locke, Hume, Rousseau, Leibniz, Kant, Hegel, Marx, Mill, and others—always approaching them deferentially and with an eye to what we could learn from them. Mentor to countless graduate students over the years, Rawls inspired many who have become influential interpreters of these philosophers.

The initial publication of A Theory of Justice in 1971 brought Rawls considerable renown. This complex book, which reveals Rawls’s thorough study of economics as well as his internalization of themes from the philosophers covered in his teaching, has since been translated into 27 languages. While there are those who would claim a greater originality for Political Liberalism, TJ remains the cornerstone of Rawls’s reputation.

2. Rawls's Mature Work: A Theory of Justice (1971)

a. The Basic Structure of Society

The subject matter of Rawls’s theory is societal practices and institutions. Some social institutions can provoke envy and resentment. Others can foster alienation and exploitation. Is there a way of organizing society that can keep these problems within livable limits? Can society be organized around fair principles of cooperation in a way the people would stably accept?

Rawls’s original thought is that equality, or a fair distribution of advantages, is to be addressed as a background matter by constitutional and legal provisions that structure social institutions. While fair institutions will influence the life chances of everyone in society, they will leave individuals free to exercise their basic liberties as they see fit within this fair set of rules. To carry out this central idea, Rawls takes as the subject matter of TJ “the basic structure of society,” defined (as he later put it) as “the way in which the major social institutions fit together into one system, and how they assign fundamental rights and duties and shape the division of advantages that arises through social cooperation.” PL at 258. Rawls’s suggestion is, in effect, that we should put all our effort into seeing to it that “the rules of the game” are fair. Once society has been organized around a set of fair rules, people can set about freely “playing” the game, without interference.

b. Utilitarianism as the Principal Opponent

Rawls explains in the Preface to the first edition of TJ that one of the book’s main aims is to provide a “workable and systematic moral conception to oppose” utilitarianism. TJ at xvii. Utilitarianism comes in various forms. Classical utilitarianism, the nineteenth century theory of Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill, is the philosophy of “the greatest good of the greatest number.” The more modern version is average utilitarianism, which asks us not to maximize the amount of good or happiness, but rather its average level in society. The utilitarian idea, as Rawls confronts it, is that society is to be arranged so as to maximize (the total or average) aggregate utility or expected well-being. Utilitarianism historically dominated the landscape of moral philosophy, often being “refuted,” but always rising again from the ashes. Rawls’s view was that until a sufficiently complete and systematic alternative is put on the table to compete with utilitarianism, its recurrence will be eternal. In addition to developing that constructive alternative, however, Rawls also offered some highly influential criticisms of utilitarianism. His critique of average utilitarianism will be described below. About classical utilitarianism, he famously complains that it “adopt[s] for society as a whole the principle of choice for one man.” In so doing, he suggests, it fails to “take seriously the distinction between persons.” TJ at 24.

c. The Original Position

Recognizing that social institutions distort our views (by sometimes generating envy, resentment, alienation, or false consciousness) and bias matters in their own favor (by indoctrinating and habituating those who grow up under them), Rawls saw the need for a justificatory device that would give us critical distance from them. The original position (OP) is his “Archimedean Point,” the fulcrum he uses to obtain critical leverage. TJ at 230-32. The OP is a thought experiment that asks: what principles of social justice would be chosen by parties thoroughly knowledgeable about human affairs in general but wholly deprived—by the “veil of ignorance”—of information about the particular person or persons they represent?

i. The Conditions and Purpose of the Original Position

The OP, as Rawls designs it, self-consciously builds on the long social-contract tradition in Western political philosophy. In classic presentations, such as John Locke’s Second Treatise of Civil Government (1690), the social contract was sometimes described as if it were an actual historical event. By contrast, Rawls’s social-contract device, like his earlier decision procedure, is frankly and completely hypothetical. While Rawls is most emphatic about this in his later work, for example, PL at 75, it is clear already in TJ. He insists there that it is up to the theorist to construct the social-contract thought-experiment in the way that makes the most sense given its task of helping us select principles of justice. Especially because of its frankly hypothetical nature, Rawls’s OP “carries to a higher level of abstraction the familiar theory of the social contract as found, say in Locke, Rousseau, and Kant.” TJ at 10.

The idea is to help justify a set of principles of social justice by showing that they would be selected in the OP. The OP is accordingly set up to build in the moral conditions deemed necessary for the resulting choice to be fair and to insulate the results from the influence of the extant social order. The veil of ignorance plays a crucial role in this set-up. TJ at sec. 23. It assures that each party to the choice is equally or symmetrically situated, with none enjoying greater power (or “threat advantage”) than any other. TJ at 116, 121. It also isolates the parties’ choice from the contingencies—the sheer luck—underlying the variations in people’s natural abilities and talents, their social backgrounds, and their particular society’s historical circumstances. About their society, Rawls has the parties simply assume that it is characterized by the “circumstances of justice,” which principally include (a) the fact that material goods are scarce, but moderately so and (b) that there is, within society, a plurality of worldviews—“conceptions of the good” —moral, religious, and secular. TJ at sec. 22.

It would be too fanciful to think of the parties to the OP as having the capacity to invent principles. The point of the thought experiment, rather, is to see which principles would be chosen in a fair set-up. To use the OP this way, we must offer the parties a menu of principles to choose from. Rawls offers them various principles to consider. Among them are his own principles (to be described below) and the two versions of utilitarianism, classical and average. The crux of Rawls’s appeal to the OP is whether he can show that the parties will prefer his principles to average utilitarianism.

Would rational parties behind a veil of ignorance choose average utilitarianism? The economist John Harsanyi argues that they would because it would be rational for parties lacking any other information to maximize their expectation of well-being. Harsanyi (1953) Since they do not know who they will be, they will therefore want to maximize the average level of well-being in society. Given Rawls’s opposition to utilitarianism, it would be ironic if Rawls’s thought experiment supported it. Because Rawls’s OP differs from Harsanyi’s choice situation in important ways, however, its parties will not prefer average utilitarianism to Rawls’s competing principles. The most crucial difference concerns the motivation that is attributed to the parties by stipulation. The veil deprives the parties of any knowledge of the values—the conception of the good—of the person into whose shoes they are to imagine stepping. What, then, are they to prefer? Since Harsanyi refuses to supply his parties with any definite motivation, his answer is somewhat mysterious. Cf. TJ at 152. Rawls instead defines the parties as having a determinate set of motivations.

ii. The Motivations of the Parties to the Original Position

The parties in the hypothetical OP are to choose on behalf of persons in society, for whom they are, in effect, trustees. PL at 76, 106. The veil of ignorance, however, prevents the parties from knowing anything particular about the preferences, likes or dislikes, commitments or aversions of those persons. They also know nothing particular about the society for which they are choosing. On what basis, then, can the parties choose? To ascribe to them a full theory of the human good would fly in the face of the facts of pluralism, for such theories are deeply controversial. Instead, Rawls suggests, we should ascribe to them a “thinner” or less controversial set of commitments. At the core of these are what he calls the “primary goods:” rights, liberties, and opportunities; income and wealth; and the social bases of self-respect. To give the parties a definite basis on which to reason, Rawls postulates that the parties “normally prefer more primary goods rather than less.” TJ at 123. This is the only motivation that TJ ascribes to the parties.

In their pursuit of the primary goods, the parties are defined as being “mutually disinterested:” each is motivated to obtain as many primary goods as he or she can and does not care if others attain primary goods. TJ at 12. The parties are motivated neither by benevolence nor by envy or spite. Many commentators think that this assumption of the parties’ mutual disinterest reflects an unattractively individualistic view of human nature, but, as with the motivations ascribed to the parties, the ascription of mutual disinterest is not intended to mirror human nature. The assumption of mutual disinterest reflects Rawls’s development of, and reaction against, both the sympathetic-spectator tradition in ethics, exemplified by David Hume and Adam Smith, and the more recent ideal-observer theory. The former tradition attempts to imagine the point of view of a fully benevolent spectator of the human scene who reacts impartially and sympathetically to all human travails and successes. The ideal-observer theory typically imagines a somewhat more dispassionate or impersonal, but still omniscient, observer of the human scene. Each of these approaches asks us to imagine what such a spectator or observer would morally approve.

Against these theories, Rawls raises a number of objections, which can be boiled down to this: either they involve neglecting the separateness of persons (in roughly the same way that utilitarianism does when it adds up everyone’s happiness), TJ at 164, or, if they seek to avoid utilitarian aggregation, they will find that “benevolence is at sea as long as its many loves are in opposition in the persons of its many objects.” TJ at 166. In other words, all difficult questions of human conflict will be simply reproduced within the sympathetic spectator’s breast. Rawls was determined to get beyond this impasse. He suggests that the OP should combine the mutual-disinterest assumption with the veil of ignorance. This combination, he argues, will achieve the rough moral equivalence of universal benevolence without either neglecting the separateness of persons or sacrificing definiteness of results. TJ at 128.

As we will see, the definite positive motivations that Rawls ascribes to the parties are crucial to explaining why they will prefer his principles to average utilitarianism. Because the parties’ motivations are essential to the arguments bearing on this central philosophical contest, it is important to attend to Rawls’s rationale for giving this motivation to the parties.

The primary goods are supposed to be uncontroversially worth seeking, albeit not for their own sakes. Initially, TJ presented the primary goods simply as goods that “normally have a use whatever a person’s plan of life.” TJ at 54. Although this claim seems quite modest, philosophers rebutted it by describing life plans or worldviews for which one or another of the primary goods is not useful. These counterexamples revealed the need for a different rationale for the primary goods. At roughly the same time, Rawls began to develop further the Kantian strand in his view. These Kantian ideas ended up providing a new rationale for the primary goods.

iii. Kantian Influence and Interpretation of the Original Position

Rawls had long admired Immanuel Kant’s moral philosophy, making it central to his teaching of the subject. See CP essays 13, 16, 23. TJ aims to build on Kant’s central ideas and to improve on them in certain respects. TJ at sec. 41. By insisting, as against utilitarianism, on the “separateness of persons,” Rawls carries on Kant’s theme of respect for persons. Kant held that the true principles of morality are not imposed on us by our psyches or by eternal conceptual relations that hold true independently of us; rather, Kant argued, the moral law is a law that our reason gives to itself. It is, in this sense, self-chosen or autonomous law. Kant’s position is not that morality requires whatever Ms. Smith or Mr. Jones chooses to believe it does. Rather, his claim is that the rational (or vernünftig) nature that each person shares shapes a single moral law, valid for all: “the categorical imperative.”

Rawls suggests that the OP well models Kant’s central ideas. The OP is set up so that the parties reflect our nature as “reasonable and rational”—Rawls’s dual way of rendering the Kantian adjective vernünftig. Once it is so set up the parties are to choose principles. Their task of choosing principles thus models the idea of autonomy. In designing the OP, Rawls also aimed to resolve what he took to be two crucial difficulties with Kant’s moral theory: the danger of empty abstractness early stressed by Hegel and the difficulty of assuring that the moral law’s dictates adequately express, as Kant thought they must, our nature as free and equal reasonable and rational beings. Rawls addresses the issue of abstractness in many ways—perhaps most fundamentally by dropping Kant’s aim of finding an a priori basis for morality. Although Rawls’s use of the veil of ignorance keeps particular facts at a distance, he insists, as against Kant, that “moral theory must be free to use contingent assumptions and general facts as it pleases.” TJ at 44. Another feature that reduces the abstractness of Rawls’s view is his focus on institutions—on the basic structure of society. In this light, we can see his institutional focus as carrying forward Hegel’s insight that the idea of human freedom can achieve an adequately concrete realization only by a unified social structure of a certain kind.

The OP also addresses the second problem with Kant’s moral theory—the problem of expression. The OP, Rawls suggests, “may be viewed … as a procedural interpretation of Kant’s conception of autonomy and the categorical imperative within the framework of an empirical theory.” TJ at 226. To be autonomous, for Kant, is to act on a law that one gives oneself, a law adequate to one’s nature as a free and equal, reasonable and rational person. The parties to the OP, in selecting principles, implement this idea of autonomy. How they represent equality and rationality are obvious, for they are equally situated and are rational by definition. Reasonableness enters the OP not principally by the rationality of the parties but by the constraints on them—most especially the veil of ignorance. They are also constrained in ways not yet mentioned and that we shall not discuss further, such as “the formal constraints of the concept of right.” TJ at sec. 23. The veil also expresses (or “models”) a crucial aspect of our freedom, namely our freedom to endorse principles in a way that is not controlled by the historical contingencies of the society into which we are born. TJ at 225.

Rawls’s attempt to solve the problem of expression also led him towards a fuller articulation of the parties’ motivations, ascribing to them certain “highest-order interests.” An intermediate step in this direction is his characterization of our three highest-order powers, the “moral powers” that persons have as reasonable and rational beings. “The rational” corresponds to Kant’s “hypothetical imperative” with its directive to take effective means to one’s ends; “the reasonable” corresponds to Kant’s categorical imperative, the moral law that demands that we do the right thing, irrespective of what our ends are. To conceive of persons as reasonable and rational, then, is to conceive of them as having certain higher-order powers. On the side of the rational, there is, first, the power to frame our ends—our “conception of the good”—and to pursue it by selecting effective means to satisfying them. Second, we can also revise our ends when we see reason to do so. Third, on the side of the reasonable, we have the power or capacity to act from “an effective sense of justice:” we can do the right thing.

This Kantian conception of the powers of reasonable and rational persons directly supports Rawls’s later account of the motivations of the parties. The parties are conceived as having highest-order interests that correspond directly to these highest-order powers. Although the account of the moral powers was present in TJ, it is only in his later works that Rawls uses this idea to defend and elaborate the motivation of the parties in the OP.

Rawls’s account of the moral powers explains why it makes sense to postulate that the parties are motivated to secure the primary goods. In various, complicated ways, in his later work, Rawls defends the primary goods as being required for free and equal citizens to promote and protect their three moral powers. This is to cast the primary goods as items objectively needed by moral persons occupying the role of free and equal citizens. While the list of primary goods may not be a perfect or complete account of what is needed to support this aspect of moral personality, Rawls claims that it is the “best available” account that we can muster in the face of the fact of reasonable pluralism. PL at 188-9.

In addition to providing a new rationale for the primary goods, Rawls’s account of the moral powers also became, in his later work, a basis for elaborating the motivations ascribed to the parties. In Political Liberalism, Rawls describes the motivation as: “The parties in the original position have no direct interests except an interest in the person each of them represents and they assess principles of justice in terms of primary goods. In addition, they are concerned with securing for the person they represent the higher-order interests we have in developing and exercising our … moral powers and in securing the conditions under which we can further our determinate conceptions of the good, whatever it is.” PL at 105-6. Here, the motivation of the parties is importantly extended by postulating that these hypothetical beings care about the moral powers of persons in society and also, by extension, about those persons’ ability to pursue what they particularly care about or are committed to.

Rawls’s assumptions about the motivations of the parties involve frankly moral content and are justified on openly moral grounds, as he had always avowed. His aim remains, nonetheless, to assemble in the OP a series of relatively uncontroversial, relatively fixed points among our considered moral judgments and to build an argument on that basis for the superiority of some principles of justice over others.

d. The Principles of Justice as Fairness

“Justice as Fairness” is Rawls’s name for the set of principles he defends in TJ. He refers to “the two principles of Justice as Fairness,” but the second has two parts. These principles address two different aspects of the basic structure of society: the “First Principle” addresses the essentials of the constitutional structure. It holds that society must assure each citizen “an equal claim to a fully adequate scheme of equal basic rights and liberties, which scheme is compatible with the same scheme for all.” PL at 5. The second principle addresses instead those aspects of the basic structure that shape the distribution of opportunities, offices, income, wealth, and in general social advantages. The first part of the second principle holds that the social structures that shape this distribution must satisfy the requirements of “fair equality of opportunity.” The second part of the second principle is the famous—or infamous—“Difference Principle.” It holds that ”social and economic inequalities … are to be to the greatest benefit of the least advantaged members of society.” PL at 6. Each of these three centrally addresses a different set of primary goods: the First Principle concerns rights and liberties; the principle of Fair Equality of Opportunity concerns opportunities; and the Difference Principle primarily concerns income and wealth. (That the view adequately secures the social basis of self-respect is something that Rawls argues more holistically). TJ at 477-8.

e. The Argument from the Original Position

The argument that the parties in the OP will prefer Justice as Fairness to utilitarianism and to the various other alternative principles with which they are presented divides into two parts. There is, first, the question whether the parties will insist upon securing a scheme of equal basic liberties and upon giving them top priority. Secondly, assuming that they will, there remains the question whether social inequalities should be governed by Rawls’s “second principle,” comprising Fair Equality of Opportunity and the Difference Principle, or else should be addressed in a utilitarian way. Making the latter choice, and so inserting utilitarianism into a position subordinate to the First Principle, yields what Rawls calls a “mixed conception.” TJ at 107.

Each of these parts of the argument from the OP is considerably aided by the clarified account of the primary goods that emerges in Rawls’s later work and that has been set out above in the section on the motivation of the parties to the OP. Regarding the first part of the argument from the OP, the crucial point is that the parties are stipulated to care about rights and liberties. They further know, as a general fact about human beings, that the determinate persons on whose behalf they are choosing are likely to have firmly and deeply-held “religious, philosophical, and moral views.” PL at 311 They also have a higher-order interest in protecting these persons’ abilities to advance these conceptions. Accordingly, “they cannot take chances by permitting a lesser liberty of conscience to minority religions, say, on the possibility that those they represent espouse a majority or dominant religion.” PL at 311. Rawls admits that persons’ deeply-held views are not always set in stone, but he insists that not all circumstances in which they may change are morally acceptable. He argues that protecting one’s ability to exercise one’s highest-order power to change one’s mind about such things requires an adequate scheme of basic liberties. PL at 312-3. In addition, he argues that securing the First Principle importantly serves the higher-order interest in an effective sense of justice—and does so better than the pure utilitarian alternative—by better promoting social stability, mutual respect, and social unity. PL at 317-24.

The second part of the argument from the OP takes the First Principle for granted and addresses the matter of social inequalities. Its sticking point has always been the Difference Principle, which strikingly and influentially articulates a liberal-egalitarian socioeconomic position. While there are questions about Rawls’s precise formulation and implementation of the principle of Fair Equality of Opportunity, it is far less controversial, both in theory and in practice. It is the Difference Principle that would most clearly demand deep reforms in existing societies. The set-up of the OP suggests the following, informal argument for the difference principle: because equality is an ideal fundamentally relevant to the idea of fair cooperation, the OP situates the parties symmetrically and deprives them of information that could distinguish them or allow one to gain bargaining advantage over another. Given this set-up, the parties will consider the situation of equal distribution a reasonable starting point in their deliberations. Since they know all the general facts about human societies, however, the parties will realize that society might depart from this starting point by instituting a system of social rules that differentially reward the especially productive and could achieve results that are better for everyone than are the results under rules guaranteeing full equality. This is the kind of inequality that the Difference Principle allows and requires: departures from full equality that make some better off and no one worse off.

While this is the intuitive idea behind the Difference Principle, Rawls’s statement of the principle is more careful and precise. Three main refinements are worth noting. First, because the principle pertains to the basic structure of society and because the parties are comparing different societies organized around different principles, the expectations that matter are not those of particular people but those of representative members of broad social classes. Second, to make his exposition a little simpler, Rawls makes some technical assumptions that let him focus only on the expectations of the least-well-off representative class in a given society. (These assumptions—of “close-knitness” and “chain-connection”—enable him to ignore, for instance, the possibility of increasing the inequality between the rich and the middle-class without affecting those on the bottom. For those who find these simplifying assumptions too restrictive, Rawls offers a multi-tiered, or “lexical,” version of the Difference Principle. TJ at 72. Allowed by these simplifying assumptions to focus only on the least well off representative persons, the Difference Principle thus holds that social rules allowing for inequalities in income and wealth are acceptable just in case those who are least well off under those rules are better off than the least-well-off representative persons under any alternative sets of social rules. This formulation already takes account of the third refinement, which recognizes that the people who are the worst off under one set of social arrangements may not be the same people as those who are worst off under some other set of social arrangements. Cf. PL at 7n.

The Difference Principle requires society to look out for the least well off. But would the parties to the OP prefer the Difference Principle to a utilitarian principle of distribution? Here, Rawls’s interpretation of the OP matters. It took a while for commentators to grasp the degree to which Rawls’s characterization of the OP departed from the much simpler one favored by Harsanyi, from the point of view of which Rawls’s argument for the Difference Principle appeared to be a plain mistake. For parties like Harsanyi’s, it would be irrational to choose the Difference Principle. Harsanyi’s parties lack any determinate motivation: as Rawls puts it, they are “bare-persons.” TJ at 152. With nothing but the bare idea of rationality to guide them, they will naturally choose any principle that will maximize their utility expectation. Since this is what the principle of Average Utilitarianism does, they will choose it. Yet as we have seen, Rawls departs from Harsanyi’s version of the thought experiment by attributing a determinate motivation to the parties, while denying that an index of the primary goods provides an interpretation of what the parties conceive to be good. Rawls never defends the primary goods as goods in themselves. Rather, he defends them as versatile means. In the later theory, the primary goods are defended as facilitating the pursuit and revision, by the persons the parties represent, of their conceptions of the good. While the parties do not know what those conceptions of the good are, they do care about whether the persons they represent can pursue and revise them.

With this departure from Harsanyi in mind, we may finally explain why the parties in the OP will prefer the principles of Justice as Fairness, including the Difference Principle, to average utilitarianism. In laying out the reasoning that favors the Difference Principle, Rawls argues that the parties will have reason to use the “maximin” rule. The maximin rule is a general rule for making choices under conditions of uncertainty. It is markedly different from the rule of maximizing expected value, the more “averaging” sort of rule that Harsanyi’s parties employ. The maximin rule directs one to select that alternative where the minimum place is higher (on whatever the relevant measure is) than the minimum place in any other alternative. Applied to the theory of social justice, maximin is an approach “a person would choose for the design of a society in which his enemy is to assign him his place.” TJ at 133.

The parties to Rawls’s OP are not “bare-persons” but “determinate-persons.” TJ at 152. They care about the primary goods and the highest-order moral powers, but they also know, in effect, that the primary goods that they are motivated to seek are not what the persons they represent ultimately care about. Accordingly, the parties will give special importance to protecting the persons they represent against social allocations of primary goods that might frustrate those persons’ ability to pursue their determinate conceptions of the good. If the parties knew they had in hand an adequate sketch of the good, they might use that to assess the gamble they face, choosing in a maximizing way like Harsanyi’s parties. But Rawls’s parties instead know that the primary goods that they are motivated to seek do not adequately match anyone’s conception of the good. Accordingly, it is rational for them to take a cautious approach. They must do what they can to assure to the persons they represent have a sufficient supply of primary goods for those persons to be able to pursue whatever it is that they do take to be good.

f. Reflective Equilibrium

Although the OP attempts to collect and express a set of crucial constraints that are appropriate to impose on the choice of principles of justice, Rawls recognized from the beginning that we could never just hand over the endorsement of those principles to this hypothetical device. Rather, he foresaw the need to “work from both ends,” pruning and adjusting things as we go. TJ at 18. That is, we need to stop and consider whether, on reflection, we can endorse the results of the OP. If those results clash with some of our more concrete considered judgments about justice, then we have reason to think about modifying the OP.

Alternatively—and this is what Rawls means by working “from both ends”—instead of modifying the OP, we might decide that the argument from the OP gives us good reason to modify the considered judgments of justice with which its conclusions clash. Eventually, we may hope that this process reaches a “reflective equilibrium.” If it does, Rawls wrote, “we shall find a description of the initial situation that matches our considered judgments duly pruned and adjusted.” Ibid.

The reflective equilibrium has been an immensely influential idea about moral justification. It is not a full theory of justification. When it was introduced, however, it suggested a different approach to justifying moral theories than was being commonly pursued. The idea of reflective equilibrium takes two steps away from the sort of conceptual analysis that was then prevalent. First, working on the basis of considered judgments suggests that it is not necessary to build moral theories on necessary or a priori premises. What matters, rather, is whether the premises are ones that “we do, in fact, accept.” TJ at 19. Rawls characterizes considered judgments as simply judgments reached under conditions where our sense of justice is likely to operate without distortion. TJ at 42. Second, the sort of pruning and adjusting that Rawls assumes will be involved in the search for reflective equilibrium implies that theories need not aim for a perfect fit with theory-independent “data.” Whereas the practitioners of conceptual analysis had raised to a fine art the method of generating counterexamples to a general theory, Rawls writes that “objections by way of counterexample are to be made with care.” TJ at 45. Checking a theory’s fit with one’s more concrete considered judgments is only a way-station on the route to reflective equilibrium. Reaching it might involve revising some of those more concrete judgments. A third novel idea about justification thus emerges from this picture: it involves arguments built in various different directions at once. The resulting justification, as Rawls puts it, “is a matter of the mutual support of many considerations.” TJ at 19, 507.

Eventually, the hope is that each person will reach a reflective equilibrium that coincides with every other person’s. Since it is up to each person, however, to determine which arguments are most compelling, Rawls stresses that the reader must make up his or her own mind, rather than trying to predict or anticipate what everyone else will think. TJ at 44.

g. Just Institutions

Part Two of TJ aims to show that Justice as Fairness fits our considered judgments on a whole range of more concrete topics in moral and political philosophy, such as the idea of the rule of law, the problem of justice between generations, and the justification of civil disobedience. Consistent with the idea of reflective equilibrium, Rawls suggests pruning and adjusting those judgments in a number of places. One of the thorniest such issues, that of tolerating the intolerant, recurs in PL. In addition to serving its main purpose of facilitating reflective equilibrium on Justice as Fairness, Part Two also offers a treasure trove of influential and insightful discussion of these and other topics in political philosophy. There is hardly space here even to summarize all the worthwhile points that Rawls makes about these topics. A summary of his controversial and influential discussion of the idea of desert (that is, getting what one deserves), however, will illustrate how he proceeds.

As we have seen, Rawls was deeply aware of the moral arbitrariness of fortune. He held that no one deserves the social position into which he or she is born or the physical characteristics with which he or she is endowed from birth. He also held that no one deserves the character traits he or she is born with, such as his or her capacity for hard work. As he wrote, “The natural distribution is neither just nor unjust; nor is it unjust that persons are born into society at some particular position. These are simply natural facts. What is just and unjust is the way that institutions deal with these facts.” TJ at 87.

In Part Two, Rawls sets out to square this stance on the moral arbitrariness of fortune with our considered judgments about desert, which do hold that desert is relevant to distributive claims. For instance, we tend to think that people who work harder deserve to be rewarded for their effort. We may also think that the talented deserve to be rewarded for the use of their talents, whether or not they deserved those talents in the first place. With these common-sense precepts of justice, Rawls does not disagree; but he clarifies them by responding to them dialectically. TJ at sec. 48. He questions whether these common-sense claims are meant to stand independently of any assumptions about whether or not the basic institutions of society—especially those institutions of property law, contract law, and taxation that, in effect, define the property claims and transfer rules that make up the marketplace—are just. It is unreasonable, Rawls argues, to say that desert is a direct basis for distributional claims even if the socio-economic system is unfair. It is much more reasonable to hold, he suggests, that whether one deserves the compensation one can command in the job marketplace, for instance, depends on whether the basic social institutions are fair. Are they set up so as to assure, among other things, an appropriate relationship between effort and reward? It is this justice of the basic structure that is Rawls’s topic.

Rawls’s alternative proposal is that the common-sense precepts about desert generally presuppose that the basic structure of society is itself fair. When they are qualified in line with this presupposition, Rawls supports them. To prevent the unqualified and the qualified claims from being confused with each other, however, he uses the term “legitimate expectations” as a term of art to express the claims of desert appropriately so qualified. A crucial idea of Justice as Fairness is that fundamental principles of justice must be respected for the rules of social cooperation to be fair, and that when they are, we should allow the free operation of the market largely to determine people’s legitimate expectations. (This dialectical clarification of the moral import of desert, however, did not satisfy all commentators. See Robert Nozick (1974).

h. Stability

In pursuing his novel topic of the justice of the basic structure of society, Rawls posed novel questions. One set of questions concerned what he calls the “stability” of those societies whose institutions live up to the requirements of a given set of principles of justice. The stability of the institutions called for by a given set of principles of justice—their ability to endure over time and to re-establish themselves after temporary disturbances—is a quality those principles must have if they are to serve their purposes.. TJ at 398-400. Unstable institutions would not secure the liberties, rights, and opportunities that the parties care about. If any set of institutions realizing a given set of principles were inherently unstable, that would suggest a need to revise those principles. Accordingly, Rawls argues, in Part Three of TJ, that institutions embodying Justice as Fairness would be stable – even more stable than institutions embodying the utilitarian principle.

In addressing the question of stability, Rawls never leaves behind the perspective of moral justification. Stability of a kind might be achieved by arranging a stand-off of opposing but equal armies. The results of such a balance of power are not of interest to Rawls. Rather, the stability question he asks concerns whether, in a society that conforms to the principles, citizens can wholeheartedly accept those principles. Wholeheartedness will require, for instance, that the reasons on the basis of which the citizens accept the principles are reasons affirmed by those very principles. PL at xlii. If stability can be grounded on such wholeheartedly moral reasons—as opposed to ulterior reasons—then it is “stability for the right reasons.” PL at xxxix. In TJ, the account of stability for the right reasons involved imagining that this wholeheartedness arose from individuals being thoroughly educated, along Kantian lines, to think of fairness in terms of the principles of Justice as Fairness. Cf. PL at lxii. As we will see, he later came to think that this account violated the assumption of pluralism.

The imaginative exercise of assessing the comparative stability of different principles would be useless and unfair if one were to compare, say, an enlightened and ideally-run set of institutions embodying Justice as Fairness with the stupidest possible set of institutions compatible with the utilitarian principle. In order to standardize the terms of comparison, Rawls discusses only the “well-ordered societies” corresponding to each of the rival sets of principles. His notion of a well-ordered society is complex. See CP at 232-5. The gist of it is that the relevant principles of justice are publicly accepted by everyone and that the basic social institutions are publicly known (or believed with good reason) to satisfy those principles.

Assessing the comparative stability of alternative well-ordered societies requires a complex imaginative effort at tracing likely phenomena of social psychology. As Rawls comments, “One conception of justice is more stable than another if the sense of justice that it tends to generate is stronger and more likely to override disruptive inclinations and if the institutions it allows foster weaker impulses and temptations to act justly.” CP at 398. In order to address the first of these issues, about the strength of the sense of justice, Chapter VIII develops a rich and somewhat original account of moral education. Drawing upon empirical research in developmental psychology, Rawls describes the gradual development of individuals’ senses of justice as involving three stages: the morality of authority, which is fostered in families; the morality of association; and the morality of principles. He argues that each of these stages of moral education will work more effectively under Justice as Fairness than it will under utilitarianism. TJ at chap. 8. He also argues that a society organized around the two principles of Justice as Fairness will be less prone to the disruptive effects of envy than will a utilitarian society. TJ at secs. 80-81.

i. Congruence

As we have seen, the veil of ignorance disconnects the argument from the OP from any given individual’s full conception of the good. The final question addressed by TJ attempts to reconnect justice to each individual’s good, not in general, but within the well-ordered society of Justice as Fairness. A stable society is one that generates attitudes, such as are encapsulated in an effective sense of justice, that support the just institutions of that society. If, in the well-ordered society, having those attitudes is also a good for the persons who have them, then there is a “match between justice and goodness” that Rawls calls “congruence.” TJ at 350.

In order to address this question of congruence, TJ develops an account of the good for individuals. Chapter VII of TJ, in fact, develops a quite general theory of goodness—called “goodness as rationality”—and then applies it to the special case of the good of an individual over a complete life. Rawls starts from the suggestion that “A is a good X if and only if A has the properties (to a higher degree than the average or standard X) which it is rational to want in an X, given what X’s are used for, or expected to do, and the like (whichever rider is appropriate).” TJ at 350-1. This idea, developed in dialogue with the leading alternatives from the middle of the 20th century, still repays attention. To work out this suggestion for the case of the good for persons, Rawls influentially developed and deployed the notion of a “life plan.” A rational plan of life for an individual, he argued, is answerable to certain principles of “deliberative rationality.” These Rawls sets out in a low-key way that masks the power and originality of his formulations. TJ at 359-72.

Rawls’s argument for congruence—that having an effective sense of justice built around the principles of Justice as Fairness will be a good for each individual—is a complex and philosophically deep one. It appeals to at least four types of intermediate good, each of which may be presumed to be of value to just about everyone: (i) the development and exercise of complex talents (which Rawls’s “Aristotelian Principle” presumes to be a good for human beings), TJ at 374, (ii) autonomy, (iii) community, and (iv) the unity of the self. Rawls’s argument for congruence is spread out across many sections of TJ. Some of its main threads are pulled together by Samuel Freeman in his contribution to The Cambridge Companion to Rawls. Freeman (2003). With regard to autonomy, to supplement the positive argument flowing from the Kantian interpretation of the OP, Rawls argues that the type of objectivity claimed for the principles of Justice as Fairness is not at odds with the idea of the autonomous establishment of principles. TJ at sec. 78. He further argues that Justice as Fairness supports the kind of tightly-knit community he calls “a social union of social unions,” marked by the shared purpose or “common aim of cooperating together to realize their own and another’s nature in ways allowed by the principles of justice.” TJ at 462. If Rawls is right about the congruence of goodness and justice, these “ways” are hardly trivial. (Not long after TJ was published, it came under attack by a set of critics who identified themselves as “communitarians,”  see for example MacIntyre (1984) and Sandel (1998). Ironically, the communitarian critique focused largely on Parts One and Two of TJ, giving short shrift to the powerful articulation of this ideal of community in Part Three.) Finally, regarding the unity of the self, Rawls criticizes the Procrustean sort of unity that could come from attaching oneself to a single “dominant end.” He notes the advantages of a conception of the unity of the self that hangs, instead, on the regulative status of principles of justice. TJ at secs. 83-85. The cumulative effect of these appeals to the development of talent, autonomy, community, and the unity of the self is to support the claim of Justice as Fairness to congruence. In a well-ordered society corresponding to Justice as Fairness, Rawls concludes, an effective sense of justice is a good for the individual who has it. In TJ, this congruence between justice and goodness is the main basis for concluding that individual citizens will wholeheartedly accept the principles of justice as fairness.

3. Recasting the Argument for Stability: Political Liberalism (1993)

Rawls has the parties to the OP assume that the society for which they are choosing principles is in the “circumstances of justice,” which include the presence of a plurality of irreconcilable moral, religious, and philosophical doctrines. But his argument for the comparative stability and the congruence of Justice as Fairness, imagines a well-ordered society in which everyone is brought up in ways deeply informed by the adherence by all adults to the same principles of justice. Accordingly, his discussion of stability and congruence in Part Three of TJ is at odds with the assumption of pluralism. In his second book, Political Liberalism [PL], he set out to rectify this “serious problem.” PL at xvii.

PL clarifies that the only acceptable way to rectify the problem is to modify the account of stability and congruence, because pluralism is no mere theoretical posit. Rather, pluralism has been endemic among the liberal democracies since the 16th century wars of religion. Moreover, pluralism is a permanent feature of liberal or non-repressive societies. It does not rest on irrationality. On the contrary, within a wide range such pluralism is “reasonable” and will not be erased by people’s attempts to cooperate reasonably. That is because a series of intractable “burdens of judgment” all but preclude reasoned convergence on fundamental and comprehensive principles about how to live. PL at 54-8. Accordingly, Rawls takes it as a fact that the kind of uniformity in fundamental moral and political beliefs that he imagined in Part Three of TJ can be maintained only by the oppressive use of state force. He calls this “the fact of oppression.” PL at 37. Since he also—unsurprisingly—holds that oppression is illegitimate, he refrains from offering fundamental and comprehensive principles of how to live. In this way, his insistence on the fact of oppression prompts a marked scaling back of the traditional aims of political philosophy.

The seminal idea of PL is “overlapping consensus.” In an overlapping consensus, each citizen—no matter which of society’s many “comprehensive conceptions” he or she endorses—ends up endorsing the same limited, “political conception” of justice, each for his or her own reasons. The principal role of the overlapping consensus is to replace TJ’s description of wholehearted acceptance. Unlike TJ’s description, the overlapping consensus conceptually reconciles wholehearted acceptance with the fact of reasonable pluralism.

Part of this newer approach is the distinction between “comprehensive conceptions,” which address all questions about how to live, and “political conceptions,” which address only political questions. This distinction has proven somewhat troublesome. The “domain of the political,” as Rawls calls it, is not completely distinct from morality. In concerning himself only with the political, he is not setting aside all moral principles and turning instead to mere strategy or Realpolitik. On the contrary, a political conception “is, of course, a moral conception,” but it is a moral conception that concerns itself only with the basic structure of society. PL at 11. Further, a political conception is one that may be developed in a “freestanding” way, drawing only upon the “very great values” of the political, rather than being presented as deriving from any more comprehensive moral or religious doctrine. PL at 139. A corollary of this approach is that such a political liberalism is not wholly neutral about the good. PL at 191-3. While Justice as Fairness is one such political conception, in PL Rawls makes a point of stressing that it is just one member of the broader family of views he refers to as the “reasonable liberal political conceptions.”

Armed with the idea of an overlapping consensus on a reasonable political conception, Rawls could have contented himself with describing the historical and sociological grounds for hoping that a reasonable overlapping consensus on a political liberalism might be reached. Hope is indeed the leitmotif of PL. E.g PL at,40, 65, 172, 246, 252, 392. But because Rawls never drops his role as an advocate of political liberalism, he must go beyond such disinterested sociological speculation. He must find and describe ways of advocating this view that are compatible with his full, late recognition of the fact of reasonable pluralism. This attempt is what makes PL so rich, difficult, and interesting.

The difficulty is this: to advocate Justice as Fairness or any other political liberalism as true would be to clash with many comprehensive religious and moral doctrines, including those that simply deny that truth or falsity apply to claims of political morality, as well as those that insist that political-moral truths derive only from some divine revelation. To preserve the possibility of an overlapping consensus on political liberalism, it might be thought that its defenders must deny that political liberalism is simply true, severely hampering their ability to defend it. To cope with this difficulty, Rawls pioneered a stance in political philosophy that mirrored his general personal modesty: a stance of avoidance. Using the “method of avoidance,” Rawls neither asserts nor denies such truth claims. CP at 395. “The central idea,” he writes, “is that political liberalism moves within the category of the political and leaves philosophy as it is.” PL at 375. Perhaps defending political liberalism as the most reasonable political conception is to defend it as true; but, again, Rawls neither asserts nor denies that this is so.

Developing a compelling freestanding presentation of political morality may be possible if we may draw upon a shared set of relevant moral ideas implicit in the “background culture” of democratic societies. PL at 14. Foremost among such shared ideas is the idea of fair cooperation among free and equal citizens. Much of PL is accordingly devoted to recasting the earlier argument for Justice as Fairness in terms that are “political, not metaphysical.” Many of the revisions concern the arguments for various features of the OP. Although these revisions occupy much of PL, they need not be covered further here, as most of them have been already anticipated in the above exposition of TJ. To have structured the exposition in this way is to have sided with those who see considerable unity in Rawls’s work, for example, Wenar (2004). One important change, however, is that PL goes to considerably further lengths to show that the values to which the view appeals are political, rather than being tied up in any particular comprehensive doctrine. For instance, that citizens are thought of as free is defended, not by general metaphysical truths about human nature, but rather by our widely shared political convictions. “On the road to Damascus Saul of Tarsus becomes Paul the Apostle. Yet such a conversion implies no change in our public or institutional identity.” PL at 31. On the contrary, our political rights ought not to vary with such changes. To think of political rights in this way is to think of citizens as free, in a relevant, political sense.

Instead of seeing a fundamental unity to Rawls’s work, some commentators emphasize what they take to be PL’s new focus on political legitimacy, as distinct from political justice, for example, Estlund (1998) and Dreben (2003). It is certainly true that Rawls prominently deploys a “liberal principle of legitimacy” that was not present in TJ. This principle states that

[O]ur exercise of political power is proper and hence justifiable only when it is exercised in accordance with a constitution the essentials of which all citizens may reasonably be expected to endorse in the light of principles and ideals acceptable to them as reasonable and rational. PL at 217; cf. 137.

This principle thus appears to connect Rawls’s view to that of others working in political and democratic theory who lean on the notion of “reasons that all can accept,” for example, Gutmann and Thompson (1996). Rawls, however, leans more heavily than most on the notion of reasonableness. This is apparent in a late essay, where he writes that “our exercise of political power is proper only when we … reasonably think that other citizens might also reasonably accept those reasons [on which it is based].” CP at 579.

These further qualifications hint at the relatively limited purpose for which Rawls appeals, within PL, to this principle of legitimacy. The principle is part of his account of “public reason” in pluralist societies. This account answers the question: how can we, in political society, reason with one another so as to set priorities and make political decisions, given the fact of reasonable pluralism and the burdens of judgment that make it permanent? Finding reasons that we reasonably think others might accept is a crucial part of the answer. The demand that we do so makes up the core of the duty of civility that binds citizens acting in any official capacity. Rawls’s limits on public reasoning have been highly controversial, but it is important to remember that they form part of his revised thought experiment about stability. The overall question of PL is similar to that of Part Three of TJ: what grounds do we have for thinking that a political liberalism would be stable? In this context, Rawls’s duty of civility may be seen as contributing his defense of the following conditional claim: if citizens of a pluralist society would abide by such restraints of civility, and if a political liberalism were the object of an overlapping consensus, then that political liberalism would be stable.

To this observation, some of the critics of Rawls’s account of public reason reply that accepting this kind of restraint on public dialogue would be too high a price to pay for a stable liberalism. See Richardson & Weithman vol. 5 (1999). Yet in his last essay on the subject, “The Idea of Public Reason Revisited” (in LP as well as CP), Rawls introduced qualifications to his duty of civility that have mollified some. To begin with, he emphasizes that this stricture is not meant to restrict public discussion in the “background culture” in any way, but only to constrain certain official interactions. He further introduces a “proviso” that allows one to rely, even in official contexts, on reasons dependent on one or another comprehensive doctrine, so long as “in due course” one provides “properly public reasons.” CP at 584. Even this revised account of civility remains highly debatable. Still, it should make a difference to the debate whether we consider the restriction only as part of a hypothetical consideration of the stability of a given well-ordered society (specifically, one that has reached overlapping consensus on some political liberalism) or rather as a doctrine about what civility requires in our society, here and now.

4. Problems of Extension

The modesty and restraint we have noted in Rawls’s general approach is also revealed in the way he set aside a number of difficult questions that properly arise within his self-assigned topic. Complicated as his view is, he was keenly aware of the many simplifying assumptions made by his argument. “We need to be tolerant of simplifications.” TJ at 45-6. His most prominent simplifications are the following two: the assumption (“for the time being”) that society is “a closed system isolated from other societies,” TJ at 7, and that “all citizens are fully cooperating members of a society over a complete life.” CP at 332; cf. PL at 20. These simplifications set aside questions about international justice and about justice for the disabled. An additional simplifying assumption implicit in the account of moral development in Part Three of TJ, is that families are just and caring. Relaxing each of these three simplifying assumptions gives rise to important and challenging “problems of extension” for a Rawlsian view.

In The Law of Peoples [LP] (1999), Rawls relaxes the assumption that society is a closed system that coincides with a nation-state. Once this assumption is dropped, the question that comes to the fore is: upon what principles should the foreign policy of a decent liberal regime be founded? Rawls first looks at this question from the point of view of ideal theory, which supposes that all peoples enjoy a decent liberal-democratic regime. At this level, with reference to a rather thinly-described global original position, Rawls develops basic principles concerning non-intervention, respect for human rights, and assistance for countries lacking the conditions necessary for a decent or just regime to arise. These principles govern one nation in its relations with others. He next discusses the principles that should govern decent liberal societies in their relations with peoples who are not governed by decent liberalisms. He articulates the idea of a “decent consultation hierarchy” to illustrate the sort of non-liberal society that is owed considerable tolerance by the people of a decent liberal society. In a part of the book devoted to non-ideal theory, Rawls impressively defends quite restrictive positions on the right of war and on the moral conduct of warfare. Surprisingly, questions of global distributive justice are confined to one brief section of LP. In that section, Rawls treats quite dismissively two earlier attempts to extend his theoretical framework to questions of international justice, those of Beitz (1979) and Pogge (1994). Drawing on the ideas of TJ, these philosophers had developed quite demanding principles of international distributive justice. In LP, Rawls instead favors a relatively minimal “duty of assistance,” with a definite “target and a cut-off point.” LP at 119.

As to justice for the disabled, Rawls never attempted an extension of his theory. He did direct some brief remarks to the topic in Political Liberalism, noting that the view generates a salient distinction between those whose disabilities permanently prevent them from being able to express their higher-order moral powers as fully cooperating citizens and those whose do not. PL at 183-6. While Rawls limited himself to this observation, Norman Daniels’ work on justice and health care may be viewed as an attempt to extend Rawls’s view in the direction the observation indicates. Daniels (1985). Nussbaum argues that Rawlsian social-contract theory is a deeply flawed basis for addressing questions of justice for the disabled and cannot be well extended to deal with them. Nussbaum (2005).

Responding to critics, Rawls did briefly address justice within the family in “The Idea of Public Reason Revisited.” CP at 595-601; LP at 156-164. He writes that he had “thought that J. S. Mill’s landmark The Subjection of Women … made clear that a decent liberal conception of justice (including what I have called Justice as Fairness) implied equal justice for women as well as men,” but admits that he “should have been more explicit about this.” CP at 595. He there affirms that “the family is part of the basic structure” and is subject to being regulated by the principles of political justice. The laws defining the rights of marriage, divorce, and the ownership and inheritance of property by families and family members are presumably all part of the basic structure of society, as are provisions of the criminal law protecting the basic rights of family members not to be abused.

In the case of the family as in economic transactions, Rawls’s stance illustrates once more how his focus on institutional justice structures his attempt to reconcile freedom and equality. Egalitarian concerns are addressed at the institutional level by assuring that protection for the appropriate rights and liberties is assured by the basic structure of society. Freedom is preserved by allowing individuals to pursue their reasonable conceptions of the good, whatever they may be, within those constitutional constraints.

5. References and Further Reading

Principal Works by John Rawls:

  • A Theory of Justice, rev. ed., Harvard University Press, 1999 [cited as TJ].
  • Political Liberalism, rev. ed., Columbia University Press, 1996 [cited as PL].
  • Collected Papers, ed. Samuel Freeman, Harvard University Press, 1999 [cited as CP].
  • The Law of Peoples, Harvard University Press, 1999 [cited as LP].
  • Lectures on the History of Moral Philosophy, ed. Barbara Herman, Harvard University Press, 2000.
  • Justice as Fairness: A Restatement, ed. Erin Kelly, Harvard University Press, 2001.
  • Lectures on the History of Political Philosophy, ed. Samuel Freeman, Harvard University Press, 2007.

Two useful gateways to the voluminous secondary literature on Rawls are the following:

  • Henry S. Richardson and Paul J. Weithman, eds., The Philosophy of Rawls (5 vols., Garland, 1999).
  • Samuel Freeman, ed., The Cambridge Companion to Rawls (Cambridge University Press, 2003).

On Rawls’s Life

  • Thomas Pogge, “A Brief Sketch of Rawls’s Life,” in Richardson & Weithman, eds., Vol. 1, pp. 1-15.

Other Works Cited:

  • Beitz, Charles. 1979. Political Theory and International Relations. Princeton University Press.
  • Daniels, Norman. 1985. Just Health Care. Cambridge University Press.
  • Dreben, Burton. 2003. On Rawls and Political Liberalism. In Freeman, 2003: 316-346.
  • Estlund, David. 1998. The Insularity of the Reasonable. Ethics 108: 252-75.
  • Gutmann, Amy and Dennis Thompson. 1996. Democracy and Disagreement. Harvard University Press.
  • Harsanyi, John C. 1953. Cardinal Utility in Welfare Economics and in the Theory of Risk-Taking. Journal of Political Economy 61: 453-5.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. 1984. After Virtue, 2d ed. (1st ed. 1981) (University of Notre Dame Press).
  • Nozick, Robert. 1974. Anarchy, State, and Utopia. NY: Basic Books.
  • Nussbaum, Martha C. 2005. Frontiers of Justice: Disability, Nationality, Species Membership (Harvard University Press).
  • Okin, Susan. 1989. Justice, Gender, and the Family. NY: Basic Books.
  • Pogge, Thomas. 1994. An Egalitarian Law of Peoples. Philosophy and Public Affairs 23: 195-224.
  • Sandel, Michael. 1998. Liberalism and the Limits of Justice, 2d ed. (1st ed. 1982) (Cambridge University Press).
  • Richardson, Henry S.  2006.  Rawlsian Social Contract Theory and the Severely Disabled.  Journal of Ethics 10: 419-462.
  • Urmson, J. O. 1950. On Grading. Mind 59: 526-29.
  • Wenar, Leif. 2004. The Unity of Rawls’s Work. Journal of Moral Philosophy 1: 265-275.

Author Information

Henry S. Richardson
Georgetown University

Giorgio Agamben (1942– )

Giorgio Agamben  is one of the leading figures in Italian philosophy and radical political theory, and in recent years, his work has had a deep impact on contemporary scholarship in a number of disciplines in the Anglo-American intellectual world. Born in Rome in 1942, Agamben completed studies in Law and Philosophy with a doctoral thesis on the political thought of Simone Weil, and participated in Martin Heidegger’s seminars on Hegel and Heraclitus as a postdoctoral scholar. He has taught at various universities, including the Universities of Macerata and Verona and was Director of Programmes at the Collège Internationale de Paris. He has been a Visiting Professor at various universities in the United States of America, and was a Distinguished Professor at the New School, University in New York. He caused a controversy when he refused to submit to the “biopolitical tattooing” requested by the United States Immigration Department for entry to the USA in the wake of the September 11, 2001 attacks.

Agamben’s work does not follow a straightforward chronological path of development either conceptually or thematically. Instead, his work constitutes an elaborate and multifaceted recursive engagement with the problems introduced into Western philosophy by the highly original and often enigmatic works of Walter Benjamin, most notably in his book on German trauerspielThe Origins of German Tragic Drama, but also in associated essays and fragments, such as his “Critique of Violence.” This is not to say that Agamben is not influenced by, nor engaged with, a number of other canonical or contemporary figures in Western philosophy and political, aesthetic and linguistic theory. He certainly is, most notably Heidegger and Hegel, as well as the scholarship that follows from them, but also Aby Warburg’s iconography (Agamben worked at the Warburg Institute Library in 1974-5), Italian Autonomism and Situationism (especially Guy Debord’s influential Society of the Spectacle), Aristotle, Emile Benveniste, Carl Schmitt and Hannah Arendt amongst others.. Beyond this philosophical heritage, Agamben also engages in multilayered discussions of the Jewish Torah and Christian biblical texts, Greek and Roman law, Midrashic literature, as well as of a number of Western literary figures and poets, including Dante, Holderlin, Kafka, Pessoa, and Caproni to name but a few. This breadth of reference and the critical stylistics it gives rise to no doubt contribute to the appearance of intimidating density characteristic of Agamben’s work. Even so, Agamben’s engagement with these figures is often mediated by his deep conceptual and thematic debt to Benjamin (he served as editor of the Italian edition of Benjamin’s collected works from 1979 to 1994) evident in his central focus on questions of language and representation, history and temporality, the force of law, politics of the spectacle, and the ethos of humanity.

Table of Contents

  1. Language and Metaphysics
  2. Aesthetics
  3. Politics
  4. Ethics
  5. Messianism
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Language and Metaphysics

As Agamben indicates in the 1989 preface to the English translation of Infancy and History, the key question that unites his disparate explorations is that of what it means for language to exist, what it means that “I speak.” In taking up this question throughout his work, and most explicitly in texts such as Infancy and HistoryLanguage and Death, and most recently, The Open, Agamben reinvigorates consideration of philosophical anthropology through a critical questioning of the metaphysical presuppositions that inform it, and in particular, the claim that the defining essence of man is that of having language. In taking up this question, Agamben proposes the necessity of an“experimentum linguae” in which what is experienced is language itself, and the limits of language become apparent not in the relation of language to a referent outside of it, but in the experience of language as pure self-reference.

Published in Italian in 1978, Infancy and History constitutes one of Agamben’s earliest attempts to grasp and articulate the implications of such an as experience of language as such.. Consisting of a series on interconnected essays on concepts such as history, temporality, play, and gesture, Infancy and History provides an importance entrance to Agamben’s later work on politics and ethics, particularly in the eponymous essay of the edition on the concept of infancy understood as an experiment of language as such. In this, Agamben argues that the contemporary age is marked by the destruction or loss of experience, in which the banality of everyday life cannot be experienced per se but only undergone, a condition which is in part brought about by the rise of modern science and the split between the subject of experience and of knowledge that it entails. Against this destruction of experience, which is also extended in modern philosophies of the subject such as Kant and Husserl, Agamben argues that the recuperation of experience entails a radical rethinking of experience as a question of language rather than of consciousness, since it is only in language that the subject has its site and origin. Infancy, then, conceptualizes an experience of being without language, not in a temporal or developmental sense of preceding the acquisition of language in childhood, but rather, as a condition of experience that precedes and continues to reside in any appropriation of language.

Agamben continues this reflection on the self-referentiality of language as a means of transforming the link between language and metaphysics that underpins Western philosophical anthropology inLanguage and Death, originally published in 1982. Beginning from Heidegger’s suggestion of an essential relation between language and death, Agamben argues that Western metaphysics have been fundamentally tied to a negativity that is increasingly evident at the heart of the ethos of humanity. While this collapse of metaphysics into ethics is increasingly evident as nihilism, contemporary thought has yet to escape from this condition. Agamben seeks to understand and ultimately escape this collapse through a rigorous philosophy of the experience of language suggested in Infancy and History. In his analysis of Heidegger and Hegel, Agamben isolates their reliance upon and indeed radicalization of negativity, by casting Da and Diese as grammatical shifters that refer to the pure taking place of language.. Here, Agamben draws upon the linguistic notion of deixis to isolate the self-referentiality of language in pronouns or grammatical shifters, which he argues do not refer to anything beyond themselves but only to their own utterance (LD, 16-26). The problem for Agamben, though, is that both Hegel and Heidegger ultimately maintain a split within language - which he sees as a consistent element of Western thought from Aristotle to Wittgenstein - in their identification of an ineffability or unspeakability that cannot be brought into human discourse but which is nevertheless its condition. Agamben calls this mute condition of language “Voice,” and concludes that a philosophy that thinks only from the foundation of Voice cannot deliver the resolution of metaphysics that the nihilism toward which we are moving demands. Instead, he suggests, this is only possible in an experience of infancy that has never yet been: it is only in existing “in language without being called there by any Voice” and dying “without being called by death” (LD 96) that humanity can return to its proper dwelling place or ethos, to which it has never been and from which it has never left.

One further dimension of Agamben’s engagement with Western metaphysics and attempt to develop an alternative ontology is worth mentioning here, since it is one of the most consistent threads throughout his work. This is the problem of potentiality, the rethinking of which Agamben takes to be central to the task of overcoming contemporary nihilism. Citing Aristotle’s proposal in Book Theta of his Metaphysics, that “a thing is said to be potential if, when the act of which it is said to be potential is realized, there will be nothing im-potential (“that is, there will be nothing able not to be,” (in HS, 45) Agamben argues that this ought not be taken to mean simply that “what is not impossible is possible” but rather, highlights the suspension or setting aside of im-potentiality in the passage to actuality. This suspension, though, does not amount to a destruction of im-potentiality, but rather to its fulfilment; that is, through the turning back of potentiality upon itself, which amounts to its “giving of itself to itself,” im-potentiality, or the potentiality to not be, is fully realized in its own suspension such that actuality appears as nothing other than the potentiality to not not-be. While this relation is central to the passage of voice to speech or signification and to attaining toward the experience of language as such, Agamben also claims that in this formulation Aristotle bequeaths to Western philosophy the paradigm of sovereignty, since it reveals the undetermined or sovereign founding of being. As Agamben concludes, ‘“an act is sovereign when it realizes itself by simply taking away its own potentiality not to be, letting itself be, giving itself to itself’” (HS 46). In this way then, the relation of potentiality to actuality described by Aristotle accords perfectly with the logic of the ban that Agamben argues is characteristic of sovereign power, thereby revealing the fundamental integration of metaphysics and politics.

These reflections on metaphysics and language thus yield two inter-related problems for Agamben, which he addresses in his subsequent work; the first of these lies in the broad domain of aesthetics, in which Agamben considers the stakes of the appropriation of language in prose and poetry in order to further critically interrogate the distinction between philosophy and poetry. The second lies in the domains of politics and ethics, for Agamben’s conception of the destruction of experience and of potentiality directly feed into an analysis of the political spectacle and of sovereignty. These also necessitate, according to Agamben, a reformulation of ethics as ethos, which in turn requires rethinking community.

2. Aesthetics

In Language and Death, Agamben raises the question of the relation of philosophy and poetry by asking whether poetry allows a different experience of language than that of the “unspeakable experience of Voice” that grounds philosophy. From a brief reflection on Plato’s identification of poetry as the “invention of the Muses,” Agamben argues that both philosophy and poetry attain toward the unspeakable as the condition of language, though both also “demonstrate this asunattainable.” Thus rejecting a straightforward prioritization of poetry over philosophy, or verse over prose, Agamben concludes that “perhaps only a language in which the pure prose of philosophy would intervene at a certain point to break apart the verse of the poetic word, and in which the verse of poetry would intervene to bend the prose of philosophy into a ring, would be the true human language” (LD, 78). This thematic subsequently drives Agamben’s contributions to aesthetics, and in doing so, the distinction between philosophy and poetry grounds a complex exercise of language and representation, experience and ethos, developed throughout his works in this area and designed to surpass the distinction itself as well as those that attend it.

Agamben’s first major contribution to contemporary philosophy of aesthetics was his acclaimed book Stanzas, in which he develops a dense and multifaceted analysis of language and phantasm, entailing engagement with modern linguistic and philosophy, as well as psychoanalysis and philology. While dedicated to the memory of Martin Heidegger, whom Agamben here names as the last of Western philosophers within this book, also most evidently bears the influence of Aby Warburg. Agamben argues in Stanzas that to the extent that Western culture accepts the distinction between philosophy and poetry, knowledge founders on a division in which “philosophy has failed to elaborate a proper language...and poetry has developed neither a method nor self-consciousness” (S, xvii). The urgent task of thought, and particularly that which Agamben names “criticism,” is to rediscover “the unity of our own fragmented word.” Criticism is situated at the point at which language is split from itself—in for instance, the distinction of signified and signifier and its task is to point toward a “unitary status for the utterance,” in which criticism “neither represents nor knows, but knows the representation” (S, xvii). Thus, against both philosophy and poetry, criticism “opposes the enjoyment of what cannot be possessed and the possession of what cannot be enjoyed” (S, xvii).

In order to pursue this task, Agamben develops a model of knowledge evident in the relations of desire and appropriation of an object that Freud identifies as melancholia and fetishism. In this, he also questions the “primordial situation” of the distinction between the signifier and the signified, to which Western reflections on the sign are beholden. He concludes this study—which encompasses discussion of fetishism and commodity fetishism, dandyism, the psychoanalysis of toys, and the myths of Narcissus, Eros and Oedipus amongst other things—with a brief discussion of Saussurian linguistics, claiming that Saussure’s triumph lay in recognizing the impossibility of a science of language based on the distinction of signified and signifier. However, to isolate the sign as a positive unity from Saussure’s problematic position is to “push the science of the sign back into metaphysics.” (S 155) This idea of a link between the notion of the unity of the sign and Western metaphysics, is in Agamben’s view, confirmed by Jacques Derrida’s formulation of grammatology as an attempt to overcome the metaphysics of presence that Derrida diagnoses as predominant within western philosophy from Plato onwards. Yet, Agamben argues that Derrida does not achieve the overcoming he hopes for, since he has in fact misdiagnosed the problem: metaphysics. Metaphysics is not simply the interpretation of presence in the fractures of essence and appearance, sensibility and intelligibility and so on. Rather; rather, the origin of Western metaphysics lies in the conception that “original experience be always already caught in a fold...that presence be always already caught in a signification” (S 156). Hence, logos is the fold that “gathers and divides all things in the 'putting together' of presence” (S, 156). Ultimately, then, an attempt to truly overcome metaphysics requires that the semiological algorithm must reduce to solely the barrier itself rather than one side or the other of the distinction, understood as the “topological game of putting things together and articulating” (S 156).

It is in the framework established here then that Agamben’s next work in aesthetics, The Idea of Prose, might be said to achieve its real importance.... Published in Italian in 1985, The Idea of Prose takes up the question of the distinction between philosophy and poetry through a series of fragments on poetry, prose, language, politics, justice, love and shame amongst other topics. This enigmatic text is perhaps especially difficult to understand, because these fragments do not constitute a consistent argument throughout the book. In the light of the foregoing though, it is possible to say that what Agamben is doing is performing and indeed undermining a difference between poetry and philosophy by breaking apart the strictures of logos. In bringing into play various literary techniques such as the fable, the riddle, the aphorism and the short story, Agamben is practically demonstrating an exercise of criticism, in which thought is returned to a prosaic experience or awakening, in which what is known is representation itself.

3. Politics

The most influential dimension of Agamben’s work in recent years has been his contributions to political theory, a contribution that springs directly from his engagements in metaphysics and the philosophy of language. Undoubtedly, Homo Sacer: Sovereign Power and Bare Life is Agamben’s best-known work, and probably also the most controversial. It is in this book that Agamben develops his analysis of the condition of biopolitics, first identified by Michel Foucault in the first volume of his History of Sexuality series and associated texts. In this volume, Foucault argued that modern power was characterized by a fundamentally different rationality than that of sovereign power. Whereas sovereign power was characterized by a right over life and death, summarized by Foucault in the dictum of “killing or letting live,” modern power is characterized by a productive relation to life, encapsulated in the dictum of “fostering life or disallowing it.” For Foucault, the “threshold of modernity” was reached with the transition from sovereign power to biopower, in which the “new political subject” of the population became the target of a regime of power that operates through governance of the vicissitudes of biological life itself. Thus, in his critical revision of Aristotle, Foucault writes that “for millennia, man remained...a living animal with the additional capacity for a political existence; modern man is an animal whose politics places his existence as a living being in question" (HS1 143).

Agamben is explicitly engaged with Foucault’s thesis on biopower in Homo Sacer, claiming that he aims to “correct or at least complete” it, though in fact he rejects a number of Foucault’s historico-philosophical commitments and claims. Suggesting that Foucault has failed to elucidate the points at which sovereign power and modern techniques of power coincide, Agamben rejects the thesis that the historical rise of biopower marked the threshold of modernity. Instead, he claims that biopower and sovereignty are fundamentally integrated, to the extent that “it can even be said that the production of a biopolitical body is the original activity of sovereign power.” (HS 6) What distinguishes modern democracy from the Ancient polis then, is not so much the integration of biological life into the sphere of politics, but rather, the fact that modern State power brings the nexus between sovereignty and the biopolitical body to light in an unprecedented way. This is because in modern democracies, that which was originally excluded from politics as the exception that stands outside but nevertheless founds the law has now become the norm: As Agamben writes, “In Western politics, bare life has the peculiar privilege of being that whose exclusions found the city of men.” (HS 7)

Several theoretical innovations inform this thesis, two of which are especially important. The first is a re-conception of political power, developed through a complex reflection upon Aristotelian metaphysics and especially the concept of potentiality, alongside a critical engagement with the theory of sovereignty posited by Carl Schmitt, which is developed through Walter Benjamin’s own engagement with Schmitt.. The second innovation introduced by Agamben is his provocative theorization of “bare life” as the central protagonist of contemporary politics.

Of the first of these, it might be argued that the key motivation within Homo Sacer is not so much an attempt to correct or complete Foucault’s account of biopolitics, as an attempt to complete Benjamin’s critique of Schmitt. In Political Theology, Carl Schmitt—the German jurist infamous for joining the Nazi party and becoming one of its strongest intellectual supporters—summarizes his strongly decisionistic account of sovereignty by claiming that the sovereign is the one that decides on the exception. For Schmitt, it is precisely in the capacity to decide on whether a situation is normal or exceptional, and thus whether the law applies or not—since the law requires a normal situation for its application—that sovereignty is manifest. Against this formulation of sovereignty, Benjamin posits in his “Theses on the Philosophy of History” that the state of emergency has in fact become the rule. Further, what is required is the inauguration of a real state of exception in order to combat the rise of Fascism, here understood as a nihilistic emergency that suspends the law while leaving it in force.

In addressing this conflict between Schmitt and Benjamin, Agamben argues that in contemporary politics, the state of exception identified by Schmitt in which the law is suspended by the sovereign, has in fact become the rule. This is a condition that he identifies as one of abandonment, in which the law is in force but has no content or substantive meaning—it is “in force without significance.” The structure of the exception, he suggests, is directly analogous to the structure of the ban identified by Jean-Luc Nancy in his essay “Abandoned Being, in which Nancy claims that in the ban the law only applies in no longer applying. The subject of the law is simultaneously turned over to the law and left bereft by it. The figure that Agamben draws on to elaborate this condition is that of homo sacer, which is taken from Roman law and indicates one who ‘“can be killed but not sacrificed.” According to Agamben, the sacredness of homo sacer does not so much indicate a conceptual ambiguity internal to the sacred, as many have argued, as the abandoned status of sacred man in relation to the law. The sacred man is “taken outside” both divine and profane law as the exception and is thus abandoned by them. Importantly, for Agamben, the fact that the exception has become the norm or rule of contemporary politics means that it is not the case that only some subjects are abandoned by the law; rather, he states that in our age, “we are all virtually homines sacri.” (HS 115).

As provocative as it is, understanding this claim also requires an appreciation of the notion of “bare life” that Agamben develops from the Ancient Greek distinction between natural life—zoe—and a particular form of life—bios, especially as it is articulated in Aristotle’s account of the origins of the polis. The importance of this distinction in Aristotle is that it allows for the relegation of natural life to the domain of the household (oikos), while also allowing for the specificity of the good life characteristic of participation in the polis—bios politikos.. More importantly though, for Agamben, this indicates the fact that Western politics is founded upon that which it excludes from politics—the natural life that is simultaneously set outside the domain of the political but nevertheless implicated inbios politicos. The question arises, then, of how life itself or natural life is politicized. The answer to this question is through abandonment to an unconditional power of death, that is, the power of sovereignty. It is in this abandonment of natural life to sovereign violence—and Agamben sees the relation of abandonment that obtains between life and the law as “originary”—that “bare life” makes its appearance. For bare life is not natural life per se—though it often confused with it in critical readings of Agamben, partly as a consequence of Agamben’s own inconsistency—but rather, it is the politicized form of natural life: neither. Neither bios nor zoe, bare life emerges from within this distinction and can be defined as "life exposed to death,” especially in the form of sovereign violence. (cf. HS 88)

The empirical point of conjuncture of these two theses on the exception and on the production of bare life is the historical rise of the concentration camp, which, Agamben argues, constitutes the state of exception par excellence. As such though, it is not an extraordinary situation in the sense of entailing a fundamental break with the political rationality of modernity, but in fact reveals the ‘“nomos of the modern’” and the increasing convergence of democracy and totalitarianism. According to Agamben, the camp is the space opened when the exception becomes the rule or the normal situation, as was the case in Germany in the period immediately before and throughout World War 2. Further, what is characteristic of the camp is the indistinguishability of law and life, in which bare life becomes the “threshold in which law constantly passes over into fact and fact into law” (HS 171). This indiscernability of life and law effectively contributes to a normative crisis, for here it is no longer the case that the rule of law bears upon or applies to the living body, but rather, the living body has become “the rule and criterion of its own application” (HS 173) thereby undercutting recourse to the transcendence or independence of the law as its source of legitimacy. What is especially controversial about this claim is that if the camps are in fact the “nomos” or “hidden matrix” of modern politics, then the normative crisis evident in them is not specifically limited to them, but is actually characteristic of our present condition, a condition that Agamben describes as one of “imperfect nihilism.”

Importantly, in addition to this, Agamben argues that the logic of the “inclusive exclusion” that structures the relation of natural life to the polis, the implications of which are made most evident in the camps, is perfectly analogous to the relation of the transition from voice to speech that constitutes the political nature of “man” in Aristotle’s account. For Aristotle, the transition from voice to language is a founding condition of political community, since speech makes possible a distinction between the just and the unjust. Agamben writes that the question of how natural bare life dwells in the polis corresponds exactly with the question of how a living being has language, since in the latter question “the living being has logos by taking away and conserving its own voice in it, even as it dwells in the polis by letting its own bare life be excluded, as an exception, within it” (HS 8). Hence, for Agamben, the rift or caesura introduced into the human by the definition of man as the living animal who has language and therefore politics is foundational for biopolitics; it is this disjuncture that allows the human to be reduced to bare life in biopolitical capture. In this way then, metaphysics and politics are fundamentally entwined, and it is only by overcoming the central dogmas of Western metaphysics that a new form of politics will be possible.

This damning diagnosis of contemporary politics does not, however, lead Agamben to a position of political despair. Rather, it is exactly in the crisis of contemporary politics that the means for overcoming the present dangers also appear. Agamben’s theorization of the “coming politics”—which in its present formulation is under-developed in a number of significant ways—relies upon a logic of “euporic” resolution to the aporias that characterise modern democracy, including the aporia of bare life (P 217). In Means without End, he argues for a politics of pure means that is not altogether dissimilar to that projected by Walter Benjamin, writing that “politics is the sphere neither of an end in itself nor of means subordinated to an end; rather, it is the sphere of a pure mediality without end intended as the field of human action and of human thought” (ME 117). In developing this claim, Agamben claims that the coming politics must reckon with the dual problem of the post-Hegelian theme of the end of history and with the Heideggerian theme of Ereignis, in order to formulate a new life and politics in which both history and the state come to an end simultaneously. This “experiment” of a new politics without reference to sovereignty and associated concepts such as nation, the people and democracy, requires the formulation of a new “happy life,” in which bare life is never separable as a political subject and in which what is at stake is the experience of communicability itself.

4. Ethics

Given this critique of the camps and the status of the law that is revealed in, but by no means limited to, the exceptional space of them, it is no surprise that Agamben takes the most extreme manifestation of the condition of the camps as a starting point for an elaboration of an ethics without reference to the law, a term that is taken to encompass normative discourse in its entirety. InRemnants of Auschwitz, published as the third instalment of the Homo Sacer series, Agamben develops an account of an ethics of testimony as an ethos of bearing witness to that for which one cannot bear witness. Taking up the problem of skepticism in relation to the Nazi concentration camps of World War II—also discussed by Jean-Francois Lyotard and others—Agamben castsRemnants as an attempt to listen to a lacuna in survivor testimony, in which the factual condition of the camps cannot be made to coincide with that which is said about them. However, Agamben is not concerned with the epistemological issues that this non-coincidence of “fact and truth” raises, but rather, with the ethical implications, which, he suggests, our age has as yet failed to reckon with.

The key figure in his account of an ethics of testimony is that of the Muselmann, or those in the camps who had reached such a state of physical decrepitude and existential disregard that “one hesitates to call them living: one hesitates to call their death death” (Levi cited in RA 44). But rather than seeing the Muselmann as the limit-figure between life and death, Agamben argues that theMuselmann is more correctly understood as the limit-figure of the human and inhuman. As the threshold between the human and the inhuman, however, the Muselmann does not simply mark the limit beyond which the human is no longer human. Agamben argues that such a stance would merely repeat the experiment of Auschwitz, in which the Muselmann is put outside the limits of human and the moral status that attends that categorization. Instead then, the Muselmann indicates a more fundamental indistinction between the human and the inhuman, in which it is impossible to definitively separate one from the other, and in that calls into question the moral distinctions that rest on this designation. The key question that arises for Agamben then, is whether there is in fact a “humanity to the human” over and above biologically belonging to the species, and it is in reflection upon this question that Agamben develops his own account of ethics. In this, he rejects recourse to standard moral concepts such as dignity and respect, claiming that “Auschwitz marks the end and the ruin of every ethics of dignity and conformity to a norm....The the guard on the threshold of a new ethics, an ethics of a form of life that begins where dignity ends” (RA 69).

In order to elaborate on or at least provide "signposts” for this new ethical terrain, Agamben returns to the definition of the human as the being who has language, as well as his earlier analyses of deixis, to bring out a double movement in the human being’s appropriation of language. In an analysis of pronouns such as “I” that allow a speaker to put language to use, he argues that the subjectification effected in this appropriation is conditioned by a simultaneous and inevitable de-subjectification. Because pronouns are nothing other than grammatical shifters or “indicators of enunciation,” such that they refer to nothing other than the taking place of language itself, the appropriation of language in the identification of oneself as a speaking subject requires that the psychosomatic individual simultaneously erase or desubjectify itself. Consequently, it is not strictly the “I” that speaks, and nor is it the living individual: rather, as Agamben writes, “in the absolute present of the event of discourse, subjectification and desubjectification coincide at every point and both the flesh and blood individual and the subject of enunciation are perfectly silent.” (RA 117)

Importantly, Agamben argues that it is precisely this non-coincidence of the speaking being and living being and the impossibility of speech revealed in it that provides the condition of possibility of testimony. Testimony, he claims, is possible only “if there is no articulation between the living being and language, if the “I” stands suspended in this disjunction” (RA, 130). The question that arises here then is what Agamben means by testimony, since it is clear that he does not use the term in the standard sense of giving an account of an event that one has witnessed. Instead, he argues that what is at stake in testimony is bearing witness to what is unsayable, that is, bearing witness to the impossibility of speech and making it appear within speech. In this way, he suggests, the human is able to endure the inhuman. More generally then, testimony is no longer understood as a practice of speaking, but as an ethos, understood as the only proper “dwelling place” of the subject. The additional twist that Agamben adds here to avoid a notion of returning to authenticity in testimony, is to highlight the point that while testimony is the proper dwelling place or “only possible consistency” of the subject, it is not something that the subject can simply assume as its own. As the account of subjectification and desubjectification indicates, there can be no simple appropriation of language that would allow the subject to posit itself as the ground of testimony, and nor can it simply realise itself in speaking. Instead, testimony remains forever unassumable.

This also gives rise, then, to Agamben’s account of ethical responsibility. Against juridical accounts of responsibility that would understand it in terms of sponsorship, debt and culpabililty, Agamben argues that responsibility must be thought as fundamentally unassumable, as something which the subject is consigned to, but which it can never fully appropriate as its own. Responsibility, he suggests, must be thought without reference to the law, as a domain of “irresponsibility” or “non-responsibility” that necessarily precedes the designations of good and evil and entails a “confrontation with a responsibility that is infinitely greater than any we could ever assume...” While it may seem as if Agamben is leaning toward a conception of ethical responsibility akin to Emmanuel Levinas' conception of infinite responsibility toward the absolute Other, this is not wholly the case, since Agamben sees Levinas as simply radicalising the juridical relation of sponsorship in unexpiatable guilt. In distinction from this, Agamben argues that “ethics is the sphere that recognizes neither guilt nor responsibility; it is… the doctrine of happy life” (RA 24).

5. Messianism

Clearly then, the conception of politics and of ethics that Agamben develops converge in the notion of “happy life,” or what he calls “form-of-life” at other points. What Agamben means by this is particularly unclear, not least because he sees elaboration of these concepts as requiring a fundamental overturning of the metaphysical grounds of western philosophy, but also because they gesture toward a new politics and ethics that remain largely to be thought. What is clear within this though is that Agamben is drawing upon Benjamin’s formulation of the necessity of a politics of pure means and, correlative to that, his conception of temporality and history, which taps a deep vein of messianism that runs through Judeo-Christian thought. This vein of messianism emerges in Agamben’s thought in a number of formulations, particularly those of “infancy,” “happy life” and “form-of-life,” and the notion of “whatever singularities.” What is also common to all these concepts is a concern with the figuration of humanity at the end of history, a concern that Agamben develops in discussion of the debates between Bataille and Kojeve over the Hegelian thesis of the end of history.

In the concept of “happy life” or “form of life,” Agamben points toward a new conception of life in which it is never possible to isolate bare life as the biopolitical subject, which, he argues ought to provide the foundation of political philosophy. As he states,

The “happy life”on which political philosophy should be founded thus cannot be either the naked life that sovereignty posits as a presupposition so as to turn it into its own subject or the impenetrable extraneity of science and of modern biopolitics that everybody tries in vain to sacralize. This “happy life” should be rather, an absolutely profane “sufficient life.” that has reached the perfection of its own power and its own communicability – a life over which sovereignty and right no longer have any hold (ME 114-115).

Happy life will be such that no separation between bios and zoe is possible, and life will find its unity in a pure immanence to itself, in “the perfection of its own power.” In this then, he seeks a politico-philosophical redefinition of life no longer founded upon the bloody separation of the natural life of the species and political life, but which is beyond every form of relation insofar as happy life is life lived in pure immanence, grounded on itself alone. This conception of a “form of life” or happy life that exceeds the biopolitical caesurae that cross the human being is developed in reference to Benjamin’s conception of happiness as he articulates it in “Theologico-Political Fragment,” a short text in which he paints a picture of two arrows pointing in different directions but nevertheless reinforcing each other, one of which indicates the force of historical time and the other that of Messianic time. For Benjamin, while happiness is not and cannot bring about the redemption of Messianic time on its own, it is nevertheless the profane path to its realization - happiness allows for the fulfilment of historical time, since the Messianic kingdom is “not the goal of history but the end (TPF 312). Drawing on this figuration, Agamben appears to construe happiness as that which allows for the overturning of contemporary nihilism in the form of the metaphysico-political nexus of biopower.

This debt also brings into focus Agamben’s reliance on the Benjaminian formulation of communicability as such, or communicability without communication, a thematic which emerges more strongly in Agamben’s somewhat anomalous essay published as The Coming Community, in which he develops the notion of “whatever singularities.” It is here that Agamben most explicitly addresses the rethinking of community that his early analyses of language and metaphysics suggested was required. In taking up the problem of community, Agamben enters into a broader engagement with this concept by others such as Maurice Blanchot and Jean-Luc Nancy, and in the Anglo-American scene, Alphonso Lingis. The broad aim of the engagement is to develop a conception of community that does not presuppose commonality or identity as a condition of belonging. Within this, Agamben’s conception of “whatever singularity” indicates a form of being that rejects any manifestation of identity or belonging and wholly appropriates being to itself, that is, in its own “being-in-language.” Whatever singularity allows for the formation of community without the affirmation of identity or “representable condition of belonging,” in nothing other than the “co-belonging” of singularities itself. Importantly though, this entails neither a mystical communion nor a nostalgic return to a Gemeinschaft that has been lost; instead, the coming community has never yet been. Interestingly, Agamben argues in this elliptical text that the community and politics of whatever singularity are heralded in the event of Tianenmen square, which he. He takes this event to indicate that the coming politics will not be a struggle between states, but, instead, a struggle between the state and humanity as such, insofar as it exists in itself without expropriation in identity.. Correlatively, the coming politics do not entail a sacralization of humanity, for the existence of whatever singularity is always irreparably abandoned to itself; as Agamben writes, ‘“The Irreparable is that things are just as they are, in this or that mode, consigned without remedy to their way of being. States of things are irreparable, whatever they may be: sad or happy, atrocious or blessed. How you are, how the world is—this is the irreparable....”(CC 90)

Agamben returns to this thematic within a critical analysis of the definition of man as the being that has language in his recent book, The Open. Agamben begins this text with reflection on an image of the messianic banquet of the righteous on the last day, preserved in a thirteenth- century Hebrew Bible, in which the righteous are presented not with human heads, but with those of animals. In taking up the rabbinic tradition of interpretation of this image, Agamben suggests that the righteous or “concluded humanity” are effectively the “remnant” or remainder of Israel, who are still alive at the coming of the Messiah. The enigma presented by the image of the righteous with animal heads appears to be that of the transformation of the relation of animal and human and the ultimate reconciliation of man with his own animal nature on the last day. But for Agamben, reflection on the enigma of the posthistorical condition of man thus presented necessitates a fundamental overturning of the metaphysico-political operations by which something like man is produced as distinct from the animal in order for its significance to be fully grasped. Agamben concludes this text—which is pragmatically an extended reflection on the Bataille-Kojeve debate—with the warning that what is required to stop the “anthropological machine” is not tracing the “no longer human or animal contours of a new creation,” but rather risking ourselves in the hiatus and central emptiness that separates the human and animal within man. Thus, for Agamben, “the righteous with animal not represent a new declension of the man-animal relation,” but instead indicates a zone of non-knowledge that allows them to be outside of being, "saved precisely in their being unsavable” (TO, 92). This articulation of the unsavable reiterates a number of Agamben’s previous comments on redemption and beatitude and provides some clearer articulation of his resolution of the dilemma of the post-historical condition of humanity as distinct from those of his precursors. But how Agamben will develop this resolution and the ethico-political implications of it in large part remains to be seen.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Agamben, Giorgio. The Coming Community, tr. Michael Hardt, University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis, 1993; La communità che viene, Einaudi, 1990. (CC)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. Language and Death: The Place of Negativity, tr. Karen E. Pinkus and Michael Hardt, University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis, 1991; Il linguaggio e la morte: Un seminario sul luogo della negatività, Giulio. Einuadi , 1982. (LD)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. Stanzas: Word and Phantasm in Western Culture, tr. Ronald L. Martinez, University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis, 1993; Stanze: La Parola e il fantasma nella cultura occidentale, Giulio Einuadi, Turin, 1977. (S)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. The Idea of Prose, tr. Michael Sullivan and Sam Whitsitt, SUNY Press, Albany, 1995; Idea della prosa, Giangiacomo Feltrinelli, Milano, 1985.
  • Agamben, Giorgio. Infancy and History, Verso, London, 1993; Infanzia et storia, Giulio Einuadi, 1978 (IH)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. Language and Death: The Place of Negativity, tr. Karen E. Pinkus, University of Minnesota, Minneapolis, 1991; Il linguaggio e la morte: Un Seminario sul luogo, Giulio Einuadi, 1982.
  • Agamben, Giorgio. Homo Sacer: Sovereign Power and Bare Life. tr. Daniel Heller-Roazen, Stanford University Press, Stanford, 1998; Homo sacer: Il potere sovrano e la nuda vita, Giulio Einuadi, 1995. (HS)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. The Man without Content, tr. Georgia Albert, Stanford University Press, Stanford, 1999; L’”uomo senza contenuto, Quodlibet, 1994.
  • Agamben, Giorgio. The End of the Poem: Studies in Poetics, tr. Daniel Heller-Roazen, Stanford University Press, Stanford, 1999. Categorie Italiane: Studi di poetica, Marsilio Editori, 1996. (EP)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. Potentialities: Collected Essays in Philosophy, ed. and tr. Daniel Heller-Roazen, Stanford University Press, Stanford, 1999. (P)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. Remnants of Auschwitz, tr. Daniel Heller-Roazen, Zone Books, New York, 1999; Quel che resta di Auschwitz, (RA)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. Means without End: Notes on Politics, tr. Vincenzo Binetti and Cesare Casarino, University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis, 2000; Mezzi sensa fine, Bollati Boringhieri, 1996. (ME)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. The Open: Man and Animal, tr. Kevin Attell, Stanford University Press, Stanford, 2004; L’aperto: L'uomo e l’animale, Bollati Boringhieri, 2002 (TO)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. State of Exception, tr. Kevin Attell, The University of Chicago Press, Chicago; 2005; Il Stato eccezione, Bollati Boringhieri, 2003. (SE)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. “Theologico-Political Fragment,” Reflections: Essays, Aphorisms, Autobiographical Writings, ed. Peter Demetz, tr. Edmund Jephcott, Schocken Books, New York: 1978, 312. (TPF)
  • Benjamin, Walter. “Critique of Violence,” Reflections: Essays, Aphorisms, Autobiographical Writings, ed. Peter Demetz, tr. Edmund Jephcott, Schocken Books, New York: 1978, 277-300.
  • Benjamin, Walter. “Theses on the Philosophy of History” Illuminations, ed. Hannah Arendt, tr. Harry Zohn, Fontana, 1973.
  • Foucault, M. History of Sexuality, Volume 1: An Introduction, tr. R Hurley, Penguin, London: 1981.

Author Information:

Catherine Mills
University of New South Wales
U. S. A.


In philosophy, egoism is the theory that one’s self is, or should be, the motivation and the goal of one’s own action. Egoism has two variants, descriptive or normative. The descriptive (or positive) variant conceives egoism as a factual description of human affairs. That is, people are motivated by their own interests and desires, and they cannot be described otherwise. The normative variant proposes that people should be so motivated, regardless of what presently motivates their behavior. Altruism is the opposite of egoism. The term “egoism” derives from “ego,” the Latin term for “I” in English. Egoism should be distinguished from egotism, which means a psychological overvaluation of one’s own importance, or of one’s own activities.

People act for many reasons; but for whom, or what, do or should they act—for themselves, for God, or for the good of the planet? Can an individual ever act only according to her own interests without regard for others’ interests. Conversely, can an individual ever truly act for others in complete disregard for her own interests? The answers will depend on an account of free will. Some philosophers argue that an individual has no choice in these matters, claiming that a person’s acts are determined by prior events which make illusory any belief in choice. Nevertheless, if an element of choice is permitted against the great causal impetus from nature, or God, it follows that a person possesses some control over her next action, and, that, therefore, one may inquire as to whether the individual does, or, should choose a self-or-other-oriented action. Morally speaking, one can ask whether the individual should pursue her own interests, or, whether she should reject self-interest and pursue others’ interest instead: to what extent are other-regarding acts morally praiseworthy compared to self-regarding acts?

Table of Contents

  1. Descriptive and Psychological Egoism
  2. Normative Egoism
    1. Rational Egoism
    2. Ethical Egoism
      1. Conditional Egoism
  3. Conclusion
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Descriptive and Psychological Egoism

The descriptive egoist’s theory is called “psychological egoism.” Psychological egoism describes human nature as being wholly self-centered and self-motivated. Examples of this explanation of human nature predate the formation of the theory, and, are found in writings such as that of British Victorian historian, Macaulay, and, in that of British Reformation political philosopher, Thomas Hobbes. To the question, “What proposition is there respecting human nature which is absolutely and universally true?", Macaulay, replies, "We know of only one . . . that men always act from self-interest." (Quoted in Garvin.) In Leviathan, Hobbes maintains that, "No man giveth but with intention of good to himself; because gift is voluntary; and of all voluntary acts the object to every man is his own pleasure." In its strong form, psychological egoism asserts that people always act in their own interests, and, cannot but act in their own interests, even though they may disguise their motivation with references to helping others or doing their duty.

Opponents claim that psychological egoism renders ethics useless. However, this accusation assumes that ethical behavior is necessarily other-regarding, which opponents would first have to establish. Opponents may also exploit counterfactual evidence to criticize psychological egoism— surely, they claim, there is a host of evidence supporting altruistic or duty bound actions that cannot be said to engage the self-interest of the agent. However, what qualifies to be counted as apparent counterfactual evidence by opponents becomes an intricate and debatable issue. This is because, in response to their opponents, psychological egoists may attempt to shift the question away from outward appearances to ultimate motives of acting benevolently towards others; for example, they may claim that seemingly altruistic behavior (giving a stranger some money) necessarily does have a self-interested component. For example, if the individual were not to offer aid to a stranger, he or she may feel guilty or may look bad in front of a peer group.

On this point, psychological egoism’s validity turns on examining and analyzing moral motivation. But since motivation is inherently private and inaccessible to others (an agent could be lying to herself or to others about the original motive), the theory shifts from a theoretical description of human nature--one that can be put to observational testing--to an assumption about the inner workings of human nature: psychological egoism moves beyond the possibility of empirical verification and the possibility of empirical negation (since motives are private), and therefore it becomes what is termed a “closed theory.”

A closed theory is a theory that rejects competing theories on its own terms and is non-verifiable and non-falsifiable. If psychological egoism is reduced to an assumption concerning human nature and its hidden motives, then it follows that it is just as valid to hold a competing theory of human motivation such as psychological altruism.

Psychological altruism holds that all human action is necessarily other-centered, and other-motivated. One’s becoming a hermit (an apparently selfish act) can be reinterpreted through psychological altruism as an act of pure noble selflessness: a hermit is not selfishly hiding herself away, rather, what she is doing is not inflicting her potentially ungraceful actions or displeasing looks upon others. A parallel analysis of psychological altruism thus results in opposing conclusions to psychological egoism. However, psychological altruism is arguably just as closed as psychological egoism: with it one assumes that an agent’s inherently private and consequently unverifiable motives are altruistic. If both theories can be validly maintained, and if the choice between them becomes the flip of a coin, then their soundness must be questioned.

A weak version of psychological egoism accepts the possibility of altruistic or benevolent behavior, but maintains that, whenever a choice is made by an agent to act, the action is by definition one that the agent wants to do at that point. The action is self-serving, and is therefore sufficiently explained by the theory of psychological egoism. Let one assume that person A wants to help the poor; therefore, A is acting egoistically by actually wanting to help; again, if A ran into a burning building to save a kitten, it must be the case that A wanted or desired to save the kitten. However, defining all motivations as what an agent desires to do remains problematic: logically, the theory becomes tautologous and therefore unable to provide a useful, descriptive meaning of motivation because one is essentially making an arguably philosophically uninteresting claim that an agent is motivated to do what she is motivated to do. Besides which, if helping others is what A desires to do, then to what extent can A be continued to be called an egoist? A acts because that is what A does, and consideration of the ethical “ought” becomes immediately redundant. Consequently, opponents argue that psychological egoism is philosophically inadequate because it sidesteps the great nuances of motive. For example, one can argue that the psychological egoist’s notion of motive sidesteps the clashes that her theory has with the notion of duty, and, related social virtues such as honor, respect, and reputation, which fill the tomes of history and literature.

David Hume, in his Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals (Appendix II—Of Self Love), offers six rebuttals of what he calls the “selfish hypothesis,” an arguably archaic relative of psychological egoism. First, Hume argues that self-interest opposes moral sentiments that may engage one in concern for others, and, may motivate one’s actions for others. These moral sentiments include love, friendship, compassion, and gratitude. Second, psychological egoism attempts to reduce human motivation to a single cause, which is a ‘fruitless’ task—the "love of simplicity…has been the source of much false reasoning in philosophy." Third, it is evident that animals act benevolently towards one another, and, if it is admitted that animals can act altruistically, then how can it be denied in humans? Fourth, the concepts we use to describe benevolent behavior cannot be meaningless; sometimes an agent obviously does not have a personal interest in the fortune of another, yet will wish her well. Any attempt to create an imaginary vested interest, as the psychological egoist will attempt, proves futile. Fifth, Hume asserts that we have prior motivations to self-interest; we may have, for example, a predisposition towards vanity, fame, or vengeance that transcends any benefit to the agent. Finally, Hume claims that even if the selfish hypothesis were true, there are a sufficient number of dispositions to generate a wide possibility of moral actions, allowing one person to be called vicious and another humane; and he claims that the latter is to be preferred over the former.

2. Normative Egoism

The second variant of egoism is normative in that it stipulates the agent ought to promote the self above other values. Herbert Spencer said, “Ethics has to recognize the truth, recognized in unethical thought, that egoism comes before altruism. The acts required for continued self-preservation, including the enjoyments of benefits achieved by such arts, are the first requisites to universal welfare. Unless each duly cares for himself, his care for all others is ended in death, and if each thus dies there remain no others to be cared for.” He was echoing a long history of the importance of self-regarding behavior that can be traced back to Aristotle’s theory of friendship in the Nichomachaean Ethics. In his theory, Aristotle argues that a man must befriend himself before he can befriend others. The general theory of normative egoism does not attempt to describe human nature directly, but asserts how people ought to behave. It comes in two general forms: rational egoism and ethical egoism.

a. Rational Egoism

Rational egoism claims that the promotion of one’s own interests is always in accordance with reason. The greatest and most provocative proponent of rational egoism is Ayn Rand, whose The Virtue of Selfishness outlines the logic and appeal of the theory. Rand argues that: first, properly defined, selfishness rejects the sacrificial ethics of the West’s Judaic-Christian heritage on the grounds that it is right for man to live his own life; and, Rand argues that, second, selfishness is a proper virtue to pursue. That being said, she rejects the “selfless selfishness” of irrationally acting individuals: “the actor must always be the beneficiary of his action and that man must act for his own rational self-interest.” To be ethically selfish thus entails a commitment to reason rather than to emotionally driven whims and instincts.

In the strong version of rational egoism defended by Rand, not only is it rational to pursue one’s own interests, it is irrational not to pursue them. In a weaker version, one may note that while it is rational to pursue one’s own interests, there may be occasions when not pursuing them is not necessarily irrational.

Critics of rational egoism may claim that reason may dictate that one’s interests should not govern one’s actions. The possibility of conflicting reasons in a society need not be evoked in this matter; one need only claim that reason may invoke an impartiality clause, in other words, a clause that demands that in a certain situation one’s interests should not be furthered. For example, consider a free-rider situation. In marking students’ papers, a teacher may argue that to offer inflated grades is to make her life easier, and, therefore, is in her self-interest: marking otherwise would incur negative feedback from students and having to spend time counseling on writing skills, and so on. It is even arguably foreseeable that inflating grades may never have negative consequences for anyone. The teacher could conceivably free-ride on the tougher marking of the rest of the department or university and not worry about the negative consequences of a diminished reputation to either. However, impartiality considerations demand an alternative course—it is not right to change grades to make life easier. Here self-interest conflicts with reason. Nonetheless, a Randian would reject the teacher’s free-riding being rational: since the teacher is employed to mark objectively and impartially in the first place, to do otherwise is to commit a fraud both against the employing institution and the student. (This is indeed an analogous situation explored in Rand’s The Fountainhead, in which the hero architect regrets having propped up a friend’s inabilities).

A simpler scenario may also be considered. Suppose that two men seek the hand of one woman, and they deduce that they should fight for her love. A critic may reason that the two men rationally claim that if one of them were vanquished, the other may enjoy the beloved. However, the solution ignores the woman’s right to choose between her suitors, and thus the men’s reasoning is flawed.

In a different scenario, game theory (emanating from John von Neumann’s and Oskar Morgenstern’s Theory of Games and Economic Behaviour, 1944) points to another possible logical error in rational egoism by offering an example in which the pursuit of self-interest results in both agents being made worse off.

This is famously described in the Prisoner’s Dilemma.

Prisoner B
Confess Don't confess

Prisoner A

Confess 5,5 ½,10
Don't Confess 10,½ 2,2

From the table, two criminals, A and B, face different sentences depending on whether they confess their guilt or not. Each prisoner does not know what his partner will choose and communication between the two prisoners is not permitted. There are no lawyers and presumably no humane interaction between the prisoners and their captors.

Rationally (i.e., from the point of view of the numbers involved), we can assume that both will want to minimize their sentences. Herein lies the rub - if both avoid confessing, they will serve 2 years each – a total of 4 years between them. If they both happen to confess, they each serve 5 years each, or 10 years between them.

However they both face a tantalizing option: if A confesses while his partner doesn’t confess, A can get away in 6 months leaving B to languish for 10 years (and the same is true for B): this would result in a collective total of 10.5 years served.

For the game, the optimal solution is assumed to be the lowest total years served, which would be both refusing to confess and each therefore serving 2 years each.
The probable outcome of the dilemma though is that both will confess in the desire to get off in 6 months, but therefore they will end up serving 10 years in total.
This is seen to be non-rational or sub-optimal for both prisoners as the total years served is not the best collective solution.

The Prisoner’s Dilemma offers a mathematical model as to why self-interested action could lead to a socially non-optimal equilibrium (in which the participants all end up in a worse scenario). To game theorists, many situations can be modeled in a similar way to the classic Prisoner’s Dilemma including issues of nuclear deterrence, environmental pollution, corporate advertising campaigns and even romantic dates.

Supporters identify a game “as any interaction between agents that is governed by a set of rules specifying the possible moves for each participant and a set of outcomes for each possible combination of moves.” They add: “One is hard put to find an example of social phenomenon that cannot be so described.” (Hargreaves-Heap and Varoufakis, p.1).

Nonetheless, it can be countered that the nature of the game artificially pre-empts other possibilities: the sentences are fixed not by the participants but by external force (the game masters), so the choices facing the agents are outside of their control. Although this may certainly be applied to the restricted choices facing the two prisoners or contestants in a game, it is not obvious that every-day life generates such limited and limiting choices. The prisoner’s dilemma is not to be repeated: so there are no further negotiations based on what the other side chose.

More importantly, games with such restricting options and results are entered into voluntarily and can be avoided (we can argue that the prisoners chose to engage in the game in that they chose to commit a crime and hence ran the possibility of being caught!). Outside of games, agents affect each other and the outcomes in many different ways and can hence vary the outcomes as they interact – in real life, communication involves altering the perception of how the world works, the values attached to different decisions, and hence what ought to be done and what potential consequences may arise.

In summary, even within the confines of the Prisoner’s Dilemma the assumptions that differing options be offered to each such that their self-interest works against the other can be challenged logically, ethically and judicially. Firstly, the collective outcomes of the game can be changed by the game master to produce a socially and individually optimal solution – the numbers can be altered. Secondly, presenting such a dilemma to the prisoners can be considered ethically and judicially questionable as the final sentence that each gets is dependent on what another party says, rather than on the guilt and deserved punished of the individual.

Interestingly, repeated games tested by psychologists and economists tend to present a range of solutions depending on the stakes and other rules, with Axelrod’s findings (The Evolution of Cooperation, 1984) indicating that egotistic action can work for mutual harmony under the principle of “tit for tat” – i.e., an understanding that giving something each creates a better outcome for both.

At a deeper level, some egoists may reject the possibility of fixed or absolute values that individuals acting selfishly and caught up in their own pursuits cannot see. Nietzsche, for instance, would counter that values are created by the individual and thereby do not stand independently of his or her self to be explained by another “authority”; similarly, St. Augustine would say “love, and do as you will”; neither of which may be helpful to the prisoners above but which may be of greater guidance for individuals in normal life.

Rand exhorts the application of reason to ethical situations, but a critic may reply that what is rational is not always the same as what is reasonable. The critic may emphasize the historicity of choice, that is, she may emphasize that one’s apparent choice is demarcated by, and dependent on, the particular language, culture of right and consequence and environmental circumstance in which an individual finds herself living: a Victorian English gentleman perceived a different moral sphere and consequently horizon of goals than an American frontiersman. This criticism may, however, turn on semantic or contextual nuances. The Randian may counter that what is rational is reasonable: for one can argue that rationality is governed as much by understanding the context (Sartre’s facticity is a highly useful term) as adhering to the laws of logic and of non-contradiction.

b. Ethical Egoism

Ethical egoism is the normative theory that the promotion of one’s own good is in accordance with morality. In the strong version, it is held that it is always moral to promote one’s own good, and it is never moral not to promote it. In the weak version, it is said that although it is always moral to promote one’s own good, it is not necessarily never moral to not. That is, there may be conditions in which the avoidance of personal interest may be a moral action.

In an imaginary construction of a world inhabited by a single being, it is possible that the pursuit of morality is the same as the pursuit of self-interest in that what is good for the agent is the same as what is in the agent’s interests. Arguably, there could never arise an occasion when the agent ought not to pursue self-interest in favor of another morality, unless he produces an alternative ethical system in which he ought to renounce his values in favor of an imaginary self, or, other entity such as the universe, or the agent’s God. Opponents of ethical egoism may claim, however, that although it is possible for this Robinson Crusoe type creature to lament previous choices as not conducive to self-interest (enjoying the pleasures of swimming all day, and not spending necessary time producing food), the mistake is not a moral mistake but a mistake of identifying self-interest. Presumably this lonely creature will begin to comprehend the distinctions between short, and long-term interests, and, that short-term pains can be countered by long-term gains.

In addition, opponents argue that even in a world inhabited by a single being, duties would still apply; (Kantian) duties are those actions that reason dictates ought to be pursued regardless of any gain, or loss to self or others. Further, the deontologist asserts the application of yet another moral sphere which ought to be pursued, namely, that of impartial duties. The problem with complicating the creature’s world with impartial duties, however, is in defining an impartial task in a purely subjective world. Impartiality, the ethical egoist may retort, could only exist where there are competing selves: otherwise, the attempt to be impartial in judging one’s actions is a redundant exercise. (However, the Cartesian rationalist could retort that need not be so, that a sentient being should act rationally, and reason will disclose what are the proper actions he should follow.)

If we move away from the imaginary construct of a single being’s world, ethical egoism comes under fire from more pertinent arguments. In complying with ethical egoism, the individual aims at her own greatest good. Ignoring a definition of the good for the present, it may justly be argued that pursuing one’s own greatest good can conflict with another’s pursuit, thus creating a situation of conflict. In a typical example, a young person may see his greatest good in murdering his rich uncle to inherit his millions. It is the rich uncle’s greatest good to continue enjoying his money, as he sees fit. According to detractors, conflict is an inherent problem of ethical egoism, and the model seemingly does not possess a conflict resolution system. With the additional premise of living in society, ethical egoism has much to respond to: obviously there are situations when two people’s greatest goods – the subjectively perceived working of their own self-interest – will conflict, and, a solution to such dilemmas is a necessary element of any theory attempting to provide an ethical system.

The ethical egoist contends that her theory, in fact, has resolutions to the conflict. The first resolution proceeds from a state of nature examination. If, in the wilderness, two people simultaneously come across the only source of drinkable water a potential dilemma arises if both make a simultaneous claim to it. With no recourse to arbitration they must either accept an equal share of the water, which would comply with rational egoism. (In other words, it is in the interest of both to share, for both may enjoy the water and each other’s company, and, if the water is inexhaustible, neither can gain from monopolizing the source.) But a critic may maintain that this solution is not necessarily in compliance with ethical egoism. Arguably, the critic continues, the two have no possible resolution, and must, therefore, fight for the water. This is often the line taken against egoism generally: that it results in insoluble conflict that implies, or necessitates a resort to force by one or both of the parties concerned. For the critic, the proffered resolution is, therefore, an acceptance of the ethical theory that “might is right;” that is, the critic maintains that the resolution accepts that the stronger will take possession and thereby gain proprietary rights.

However, ethical egoism does not have to logically result in a Darwinian struggle between the strong and the weak in which strength determines moral rectitude to resources or values. Indeed, the “realist” position may strike one as philosophically inadequate as that of psychological egoism, although popularly attractive. For example, instead of succumbing to insoluble conflict, the two people could cooperate (as rational egoism would require). Through cooperation, both agents would, thereby, mutually benefit from securing and sharing the resource. Against the critic’s pessimistic presumption that conflict is insoluble without recourse to victory, the ethical egoist can retort that reasoning people can recognize that their greatest interests are served more through cooperation than conflict. War is inherently costly, and, even the fighting beasts of the wild instinctively recognize its potential costs, and, have evolved conflict-avoiding strategies.

On the other hand, the ethical egoist can argue less benevolently, that in case one man reaches the desired resource first, he would then be able to take rightful control and possession of it – the second person cannot possess any right to it, except insofar as he may trade with its present owner. Of course, charitable considerations may motivate the owner to secure a share for the second comer, and economic considerations may prompt both to trade in those products that each can better produce or acquire: the one may guard the water supply from animals while the other hunts. Such would be a classical liberal reading of this situation, which considers the advance of property rights to be the obvious solution to apparently intractable conflicts over resources.

A second conflict-resolution stems from critics’ fears that ethical egoists could logically pursue their interests at the cost of others. Specifically, a critic may contend that personal gain logically cannot be in one’s best interest if it entails doing harm to another: doing harm to another would be to accept the principle that doing harm to another is ethical (that is, one would be equating “doing harm” with “one’s own best interests”), whereas, reflection shows that principle to be illogical on universalistic criteria. However, an ethical egoist may respond that in the case of the rich uncle and greedy nephew, for example, it is not the case that the nephew would be acting ethically by killing his uncle, and that for a critic to contend otherwise is to criticize personal gain from the separate ethical standpoint that condemns murder. In addition, the ethical egoist may respond by saying that these particular fears are based on a confusion resulting from conflating ethics (that is, self-interest) with personal gain; The ethical egoist may contend that if the nephew were to attempt to do harm for personal gain, that he would find that his uncle or others would or may be permitted to do harm in return. The argument that “I have a right to harm those who get in my way” is foiled by the argument that “others have a right to harm me should I get in the way.” That is, in the end, the nephew variously could see how harming another for personal gain would not be in his self-interest at all.

The critics’ fear is based on a misreading of ethical egoism, and is an attempt to subtly reinsert the “might is right” premise. Consequently, the ethical egoist is unfairly chastised on the basis of a straw-man argument. Ultimately, however, one comes to the conclusion reached in the discussion of the first resolution; that is, one must either accept the principle that might is right (which in most cases would be evidentially contrary to one’s best interest), or accept that cooperation with others is a more successful approach to improving one’s interests. Though interaction can either be violent or peaceful, an ethical egoist rejects violence as undermining the pursuit of self-interest.

A third conflict-resolution entails the insertion of rights as a standard. This resolution incorporates the conclusions of the first two resolutions by stating that there is an ethical framework that can logically be extrapolated from ethical egoism. However, the logical extrapolation is philosophically difficult (and, hence, intriguing) because ethical egoism is the theory that the promotion of one’s own self-interest is in accordance with morality whereas rights incorporate boundaries to behavior that reason or experience has shown to be contrary to the pursuit of self-interest. Although it is facile to argue that the greedy nephew does not have a right to claim his uncle’s money because it is not his but his uncle’s, and to claim that it is wrong to act aggressively against the person of another because that person has a legitimate right to live in peace (thus providing the substance of conflict-resolution for ethical egoism), the problem of expounding this theory for the ethical egoist lies in the intellectual arguments required to substantiate the claims for the existence of rights and then, once substantiated, connecting them to the pursuit of an individual’s greatest good.

i. Conditional Egoism

A final type of ethical egoism is conditional egoism. This is the theory that egoism is morally acceptable or right if it leads to morally acceptable ends. For example, self-interested behavior can be accepted and applauded if it leads to the betterment of society as a whole; the ultimate test rests not on acting self-interestedly but on whether society is improved as a result. A famous example of this kind of thinking is from Adam Smith’s The Wealth of Nations, in which Smith outlines the public benefits resulting from self-interested behavior (borrowing a theory from the earlier writer Bernard Mandeville and his Fable of the Bees). Smith writes: "It is not from the benevolence of the butcher, the brewer, or the baker, that we expect our dinner, but from their regard to their own interest. We address ourselves, not to their humanity but to their self-love, and never talk to them of our own necessities but of their advantages" (Wealth of Nations, I.ii.2).

As Smith himself admits, if egoistic behavior lends itself to society’s detriment, then it ought to be stopped. The theory of conditional egoism is thus dependent on a superior moral goal such as an action being in the common interest, that is, the public good. The grave problem facing conditional egoists is according to what standard ought the limits on egoism be placed? In other words, who or what is to define the nature of the public good? If it is a person who is set up as the great arbitrator of the public, then it is uncertain if there can be a guarantee that he or she is embodying or arguing for an impartial standard of the good and not for his or her own particular interest. If it is an impartial standard that sets the limit, one that can be indicated by any reasonable person, then it behooves the philosopher to explain the nature of that standard.

In most “public good” theories, the assumption is made that there exists a collective entity over and above the individuals that comprise it: race, nation, religion, and state being common examples. Collectivists then attempt to explain what in particular should be held as the interest of the group. Inevitably, however, conflict arises, and resolutions have to be produced. Some seek refuge in claiming the need for perpetual dialogue (rather than exchange), but others return to the need for force to settle apparently insoluble conflicts; nonetheless, the various shades of egoism pose a valid and appealing criticism of collectivism: that individuals act; groups don’t. Karl Popper’s works on methodological individualism are a useful source in criticizing collectivist thinking (for example, Popper’s The Poverty of Historicism).

3. Conclusion

Psychological egoism is fraught with the logical problem of collapsing into a closed theory, and hence being a mere assumption that could validly be accepted as describing human motivation and morality, or be rejected in favor of a psychological altruism (or even a psychological ecologism in which all actions necessarily benefit the agent’s environment).

Normative egoism, however, engages in a philosophically more intriguing dialogue with protractors. Normative egoists argue from various positions that an individual ought to pursue his or her own interest. These may be summarized as follows: the individual is best placed to know what defines that interest, or it is thoroughly the individual’s right to pursue that interest. The latter is divided into two sub-arguments: either because it is the reasonable/rational course of action, or because it is the best guarantee of maximizing social welfare.

Egoists also stress that the implication of critics’ condemnation of self-serving or self-motivating action is the call to renounce freedom in favor of control by others, who then are empowered to choose on their behalf. This entails an acceptance of Aristotle’s political maxim that "some are born to rule and others are born to be ruled," also read as "individuals are generally too stupid to act either in their own best interests or in the interests of those who would wish to command them." Rejecting both descriptions (the first as being arrogant and empirically questionable and the second as unmasking the truly immoral ambition lurking behind attacks on selfishness), egoists ironically can be read as moral and political egalitarians glorifying the dignity of each and every person to pursue life as they see fit. Mistakes in securing the proper means and appropriate ends will be made by individuals, but if they are morally responsible for their actions they not only will bear the consequences but also the opportunity for adapting and learning. When that responsibility is removed and individuals are exhorted to live for an alternative cause, their incentive and joy in improving their own welfare is concomitantly diminished, which will, for many egoists, ultimately foster an uncritical, unthinking mass of obedient bodies vulnerable to political manipulation: when the ego is trammeled, so too is freedom ensnared, and without freedom ethics is removed from individual to collective or government responsibility.

Egoists also reject the insight into personal motivation that others – whether they are psychological or sociological "experts" – declare they possess, and which they may accordingly fine-tune or encourage to "better ends." Why an individual acts remains an intrinsically personal and private act that is the stuff of memoirs and literature, but how they should act releases our investigations into ethics of what shall define the good for the self-regarding agent.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle. Nichomachaean Ethics. Various translations available. Book IX being most pertinent.
  • Baier, Kurt. “Egoisim” in A Companion to Ethics. Ed. Peter Singer. Blackwell: Oxford. 1990.
  • Feinberg, Joel. “Psychological Egoism” in Ethics: History, Theory, and Contemporary Issues. Oxford University Press: Oxford. 1998.
  • Garvin, Lucius. A Modern Introduction to Ethics. Houghton Mifflin: Cambrirdge, MA, 1953.
  • Hargreaves-Heap, Shaun P. and Yanis Varoufakis. Game Theory: A Critical Introduction. Routledge: London, 1995.
  • Holmes, S.J. Life and Morals. MacMillan: London, 1948.
  • Hospers, John. “Ethical Egoism,” in An Introduction to Philosophical Analysis. 2nd Edition. Routledge, Kegan Paul: London, 1967.
  • Hume, David. Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals.
  • Peikoff, Leonard. Objectivism: The Philosophy of Ayn Rand. Meridian: London, 1993.
  • Popper, Karl. Poverty of Historicism. Routledge & Kegan Paul: London, 1976.
  • Rachels, James. Elements of Moral Philosophy. Mcgraw-Hill: London, 1995.
  • Rand, Ayn. Virtue of Selfishness. Signet: New York, 1964.
  • Rand, Ayn. The Fountainhead. Harper Collins: New York. 1961.
  • Sidgwick, Henry. The Methods of Ethics. MacMillan: London, 1901.
  • Smith, Adam. Wealth of Nations.
  • Smith, Adam. Theory of Moral Sentiments.

Author Information

Alexander Moseley
United Kingdom

Aristotle: Politics

aristotleIn his Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.) describes the happy life intended for man by nature as one lived in accordance with virtue, and, in his Politics, he describes the role that politics and the political community must play in bringing about the virtuous life in the citizenry.

The Politics also provides analysis of the kinds of political community that existed in his time and shows where and how these cities fall short of the ideal community of virtuous citizens.

Although in some ways we have clearly moved beyond his thought (for example, his belief in the inferiority of women and his approval of slavery in at least some circumstances), there remains much in Aristotle’s philosophy that is valuable today.

In particular, his views on the connection between the well-being of the political community and that of the citizens who make it up, his belief that citizens must actively participate in politics if they are to be happy and virtuous, and his analysis of what causes and prevents revolution within political communities have been a source of inspiration for many contemporary theorists, especially those unhappy with the liberal political philosophy promoted by thinkers such as John Locke and John Stuart Mill.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography and History
  2. The Texts
  3. Challenges of the Texts
  4. Politics and Ethics
  5. The Importance of Telos
  6. The Text of the Politics
  7. The Politics, Book I
    1. The Purpose of the City
    2. How the City Comes Into Being
    3. Man, the Political Animal
    4. Slavery
    5. Women
  8. The Politics, Book II
    1. What Kind of Partnership Is a City?
    2. Existing Cities: Sparta, Crete, Carthage
  9. The Politics, Book III
    1. Who Is the Citizen?
    2. The Good Citizen and the Good Man
    3. Who Should Rule?
  10. The Politics, Book IV
    1. Polity: The Best Practical Regime
    2. The Importance of the Middle Class
  11. The Politics, Book V
    1. Conflict Between the Rich and the Poor
    2. How to Preserve Regimes
  12. The Politics, Book VI
    1. Varieties of Democracy
    2. The Best Kind of Democracy
    3. The Role of Wealth in a Democracy
  13. The Politics, Book VII
    1. The Best Regime and the Best Men
    2. Characteristics of the Best City
  14. The Politics, Book VIII
    1. The Education of the Young
  15. References and Further Reading

1. Biography and History

Aristotle's life was primarily that of a scholar. However, like the other ancient philosophers, it was not the stereotypical ivory tower existence. His father was court physician to Amyntas III of Macedon, so Aristotle grew up in a royal household. Aristotle also knew Philip of Macedon (son of Amyntas III) and there is a tradition that says Aristotle tutored Philip’s son Alexander, who would later be called "the Great" after expanding the Macedonian Empire all the way to what is now India. Clearly, Aristotle had significant firsthand experience with politics, though scholars disagree about how much influence, if any, this experience had on Aristotle's thought. There is certainly no evidence that Alexander's subsequent career was much influenced by Aristotle's teaching, which is uniformly critical of war and conquest as goals for human beings and which praises the intellectual, contemplative lifestyle. It is noteworthy that although Aristotle praises the politically active life, he spent most of his own life in Athens, where he was not a citizen and would not have been allowed to participate directly in politics (although of course anyone who wrote as extensively and well about politics as Aristotle did was likely to be politically influential).

Aristotle studied under Plato at Plato's Academy in Athens, and eventually opened a school of his own (the Lyceum) there. As a scholar, Aristotle had a wide range of interests. He wrote about meteorology, biology, physics, poetry, logic, rhetoric, and politics and ethics, among other subjects. His writings on many of these interests remained definitive for almost two millennia. They remained, and remain, so valuable in part because of the comprehensiveness of his efforts. For example, in order to understand political phenomena, he had his students collect information on the political organization and history of 158 different cities. The Politics makes frequent reference to political events and institutions from many of these cities, drawing on his students' research. Aristotle’s theories about the best ethical and political life are drawn from substantial amounts of empirical research. These studies, and in particular the Constitution of Athens, will be discussed in more detail below (Who Should Rule?). The question of how these writings should be unified into a consistent whole (if that is even possible) is an open one and beyond the scope of this article. This article will not attempt to organize all of Aristotle's work into a coherent whole, but will draw on different texts as they are necessary to complete one version of Aristotle's view of politics.

2. The Texts

The most important text for understanding Aristotle's political philosophy, not surprisingly, is the Politics. However, it is also important to read Nicomachean Ethics in order to fully understand Aristotle's political project. This is because Aristotle believed that ethics and politics were closely linked, and that in fact the ethical and virtuous life is only available to someone who participates in politics, while moral education is the main purpose of the political community. As he says in Nicomachean Ethics at 1099b30, "The end [or goal] of politics is the best of ends; and the main concern of politics is to engender a certain character in the citizens and to make them good and disposed to perform noble actions." Most people living today in Western societies like the United States, Canada, Germany, or Australia would disagree with both parts of that statement. We are likely to regard politics (and politicians) as aiming at ignoble, selfish ends, such as wealth and power, rather than the "best end", and many people regard the idea that politics is or should be primarily concerned with creating a particular moral character in citizens as a dangerous intrusion on individual freedom, in large part because we do not agree about what the "best end" is. In fact, what people in Western societies generally ask from politics and the government is that they keep each of us safe from other people (through the provision of police and military forces) so that each of us can choose and pursue our own ends, whatever they may be. This has been the case in Western political philosophy at least since John Locke. Development of individual character is left up to the individual, with help from family, religion, and other non-governmental institutions. More will be said about this later, but the reader should keep in mind that this is an important way in which our political and ethical beliefs are not Aristotle's. The reader is also cautioned against immediately concluding from this that Ar istotle was wrong and we are right. This may be so, but it is important to understand why, and the contrast between Aristotle's beliefs and ours can help to bring the strengths and weaknesses of our own beliefs into greater clarity.

The reference above to "Nicomachean Ethics at 1099b30" makes use of what is called Bekker pagination. This refers to the location of beginning of the cited text in the edition of Aristotle's works produced by Immanuel Bekker in Berlin in 1831 (in this case, it begins on page 1099, column b, line 30). Scholars make use of this system for all of Aristotle's works except the Constitution of Athens (which was not rediscovered until after 1831) and fragmentary works in order to be able to refer to the same point in Aristotle's work regardless of which edition, translation, or language they happen to be working with. This entry will make use of the Bekker pagination system, and will also follow tradition and refer to Nicomachean Ethics as simply Ethics. (There is also a Eudemian Ethics which is almost certainly by Aristotle (and which shares three of the ten books of the Nicomachean Ethics) and a work on ethics titled Magna Moralia which has been attributed to him but which most scholars now believe is not his work. Regardless, most scholars believe that the Nicomachean Ethics is Aristotle's fullest and most mature expression of his ethical theory). The translation is that of Martin Ostwald; see the bibliography for full information. In addition to the texts listed above, the student with an interest in Aristotle’s political theory may also wish to read the Rhetoric, which includes observations on ethics and politics in the context of teaching the reader how to be a more effective speaker, and the Constitution of Athens, a work attributed to Aristotle, but which may be by one of his students, which describes the political history of the city of Athens.

3. Challenges of the Texts

Any honest attempt to summarize and describe Aristotle's political philosophy must include an acknowledgment that there is no consensus on many of the most important aspects of that philosophy. Some of the reasons for this should be mentioned from the outset.

One set of reasons has to do with the text itself and the transmission of the text from Aristotle's time to ours. The first thing that can lead to disagreement over Aristotle's beliefs is the fact that the Politics andEthics are believed by many scholars to be his lecture notes, for lectures which were intended to be heard only by his own students. (Aristotle did write for general audiences on these subjects, probably in dialogue form, but only a few fragments of those writings remain). This is also one reason why many students have difficulty reading his work: no teacher's lecture notes ever make complete sense to anyone else (their meaning can even elude their author at times). Many topics in the texts are discussed less fully than we would like, and many things are ambiguous which we wish were more straightforward. But if Aristotle was lecturing from these writings, he could have taken care of these problems on the fly as he lectured, since presumably he knew what he meant, or he could have responded to requests for clarification or elaboration from his students.

Secondly, most people who read Aristotle are not reading him in the original Attic Greek but are instead reading translations. This leads to further disagreement, because different authors translate Aristotle differently, and the way in which a particular word is translated can be very significant for the text as a whole. There is no way to definitively settle the question of what Aristotle "really meant to say" in using a particular word or phrase.

Third, the Aristotelian texts we have are not the originals, but copies, and every time a text gets copied errors creep in (words, sentences, or paragraphs can get left out, words can be changed into new words, and so forth). For example, imagine someone writing the sentence "Ronald Reagan was the lastcompetent president of the United States." It is copied by hand, and the person making the copy accidentally writes (or assumes that the author must have written) "Ronald Reagan was the leastcompetent president of the United States." If the original is then destroyed, so that only the copy remains, future generations will read a sentence that means almost exactly the opposite of what the author intended. It may be clear from the context that a word has been changed, but then again it may not, and there is always hesitation in changing the text as we have it. In addition, although nowadays it is unacceptable to modify someone else's work without clearly denoting the changes, this is a relatively recent development and there are portions of Aristotle's texts which scholars believe were added by later writers. This, too, complicates our understanding of Aristotle.

Finally, there are a number of controversies related to the text of the Politics in particular. These controversies cannot be discussed here, but should be mentioned. For more detail consult the works listed in the "Suggestions for further reading" below. First, there is disagreement about whether the books of the Politics are in the order that Aristotle intended. Carnes Lord and others have argued based on a variety of textual evidence that books 7 and 8 were intended by Aristotle to follow book 3. Rearranging the text in this way would have the effect of joining the early discussion of the origins of political life and the city, and the nature of political justice, with the discussion of the ideal city and the education appropriate for it, while leaving together books 4-6 which are primarily concerned with existing varieties of regimes and how they are preserved and destroyed and moving them to the conclusion of the book. Second, some authors, notably Werner Jaeger, have argued that the different focus and orientation of the different portions of the Politics is a result of Aristotle writing them at different times, reflecting his changing interests and orientation towards Plato's teachings. The argument is that at first Aristotle stuck very closely to the attitudes and ideas of his teacher Plato, and only later developed his own more empirical approach. Thus any difficulties that there may be in integrating the different parts of the Politicsarise from the fact that they were not meant to be integrated and were written at different times and with different purposes. Third, the Politics as we have it appears to be incomplete; Book 6 ends in the middle of a sentence and Book 8 in the middle of a discussion. There are also several places in the Politicswhere Aristotle promises to consider a topic further later but does not do so in the text as we have i t (for example, at the end of Book II, Chapter 8). It is possible that Aristotle never finished writing it; more likely there is material missing as a result of damage to the scrolls on which it was written. The extent and content of any missing material is a matter of scholarly debate.

Fortunately, the beginning student of Aristotle will not need to concern themselves much with these problems. It is, however, important to get a quality translation of the text, which provides an introduction, footnotes, a glossary, and a bibliography, so that the reader is aware of places where, for example, there seems to be something missing from the text, or a word can have more than one meaning, or there are other textual issues. These will not always be the cheapest or most widely available translations, but it is important to get one of them, from a library if need be. Several suggested editions are listed at the end of this article.

4. Politics and Ethics

In Book Six of the Ethics Aristotle says that all knowledge can be classified into three categories: theoretical knowledge, practical knowledge, and productive knowledge. Put simply, these kinds of knowledge are distinguished by their aims: theoretical knowledge aims at contemplation, productive knowledge aims at creation, and practical knowledge aims at action. Theoretical knowledge involves the study of truth for its own sake; it is knowledge about things that are unchanging and eternal, and includes things like the principles of logic, physics, and mathematics (at the end of the Ethics Aristotle says that the most excellent human life is one lived in pursuit of this type of knowledge, because this knowledge brings us closest to the divine). The productive and practical sciences, in contrast, address our daily needs as human beings, and have to do with things that can and do change. Productive knowledge means, roughly, know-how; the knowledge of how to make a table or a house or a pair of shoes or how to write a tragedy would be examples of this kind of knowledge. This entry is concerned with practical knowledge, which is the knowledge of how to live and act. According to Aristotle, it is the possession and use of practical knowledge that makes it possible to live a good life. Ethics and politics, which are the practical sciences, deal with human beings as moral agents. Ethics is primarily about the actions of human beings as individuals, and politics is about the actions of human beings in communities, although it is important to remember that for Aristotle the two are closely linked and each influences the other.

The fact that ethics and politics are kinds of practical knowledge has several important consequences. First, it means that Aristotle believes that mere abstract knowledge of ethics and politics is worthless. Practical knowledge is only useful if we act on it; we must act appropriately if we are to be moral. He says at Ethics 1103b25: "The purpose of the present study [of morality] is not, as it is in other inquiries, the attainment of theoretical knowledge: we are not conducting this inquiry in order to know what virtue is, but in order to become good, else there would be no advantage in studying it."

Second, according to Aristotle, only some people can beneficially study politics. Aristotle believes that women and slaves (or at least those who are slaves by nature) can never benefit from the study of politics, and also should not be allowed to participate in politics, about which more will be said later. But there is also a limitation on political study based on age, as a result of the connection between politics and experience: "A young man is not equipped to be a student of politics; for he has no experience in the actions which life demands of him, and these actions form the basis and subject matter of the discussion" (Ethics 1095a2). Aristotle adds that young men will usually act on the basis of their emotions, rather than according to reason, and since acting on practical knowledge requires the use of reason, young men are unequipped to study politics for this reason too. So the study of politics will only be useful to those who have the experience and the mental discipline to benefit from it, and for Aristotle this would have been a relatively small percentage of the population of a city. Even in Athens, the most democratic city in Greece, no more than 15 percent of the population was ever allowed the benefits of citizenship, including political participation. Athenian citizenship was limited to adult males who were not slaves and who had one parent who was an Athenian citizen (sometimes citizenship was further restricted to require both parents to be Athenian citizens). Aristotle does not think this percentage should be increased - if anything, it should be decreased.

Third, Aristotle distinguishes between practical and theoretical knowledge in terms of the level of precision that can be attained when studying them. Political and moral knowledge does not have the same degree of precision or certainty as mathematics. Aristotle says at Ethics 1094b14: "Problems of what is noble and just, which politics examines, present so much variety and irregularity that some people believe that they exist only by convention and not by nature….Therefore, in a discussion of such subjects, which has to start with a basis of this kind, we must be satisfied to indicate the truth with a rough and general sketch: when the subject and the basis of a discussion consist of matters that hold good only as a general rule, but not always, the conclusions reached must be of the same order." Aristotle does not believe that the noble and the just exist only by convention, any more than, say, the principles of geometry do. However, the principles of geometry are fixed and unchanging. The definition of a point, or a line, or a plane, can be given precisely, and once this definition is known, it is fixed and unchanging for everyone. However, the definition of something like justice can only be known generally; there is no fixed and unchanging definition that will always be correct. This means that unlike philosophers such as Hobbes and Kant, Aristotle does not and in fact cannot give us a fixed set of rules to be followed when ethical and political decisions must be made. Instead he tries to make his students the kind of men who, when confronted with any particular ethical or political decision, will know the correct thing to do, will understand why it is the correct choice, and will choose to do it for that reason. Such a man will know the general rules to be followed, but will also know when and why to deviate from those rules. (I will use "man" and "men" when referring to citizens so that the reader keeps in mind that Aristotle, and the Greeks generally, excluded women from political part icipation. In fact it is not until the mid-19th century that organized attempts to gain the right to vote for women really get underway, and even today in the 21st century there are still many countries which deny women the right to vote or participate in political life).

5. The Importance of Telos

I have already noted the connection between ethics and politics in Aristotle's thought. The concept that most clearly links the two is that which Aristotle called telos. A discussion of this concept and its importance will help the reader make sense of what follows. Aristotle himself discusses it in Book II, Chapter 3 of the Physics and Book I, Chapter 3 of the Metaphysics.

The word telos means something like purpose, or goal, or final end. According to Aristotle, everything has a purpose or final end. If we want to understand what something is, it must be understood in terms of that end, which we can discover through careful study. It is perhaps easiest to understand what a telos is by looking first at objects created by human beings. Consider a knife. If you wanted to describe a knife, you would talk about its size, and its shape, and what it is made out of, among other things. But Aristotle believes that you would also, as part of your description, have to say that it is made to cut things. And when you did, you would be describing its telos. The knife's purpose, or reason for existing, is to cut things. And Aristotle would say that unless you included that telos in your description, you wouldn't really have described - or understood – the knife. This is true not only of things made by humans, but of plants and animals as well. If you were to fully describe an acorn, you would include in your description that it will become an oak tree in the natural course of things – so acorns too have a telos. Suppose you were to describe an animal, like a thoroughbred foal. You would talk about its size, say it has four legs and hair, and a tail. Eventually you would say that it is meant to run fast. This is the horse's telos, or purpose. If nothing thwarts that purpose, the young horse will indeed become a fast runner.

Here we are not primarily concerned with the telos of a knife or an acorn or a foal. What concerns us is the telos of a human being. Just like everything else that is alive, human beings have a telos. What is it that human beings are meant by nature to become in the way that knives are meant to cut, acorns are meant to become oak trees, and thoroughbred ponies are meant to become race horses? According to Aristotle, we are meant to become happy. This is nice to hear, although it isn't all that useful. After all, people find happiness in many different ways. However, Aristotle says that living happily requires living a life of virtue. Someone who is not living a life that is virtuous, or morally good, is also not living a happy life, no matter what they might think. They are like a knife that will not cut, an oak tree that is diseased and stunted, or a racehorse that cannot run. In fact they are worse, since they have chosen the life they lead in a way that a knife or an acorn or a horse cannot.

Someone who does live according to virtue, who chooses to do the right thing because it is the right thing to do, is living a life that flourishes; to borrow a phrase, they are being all that they can be by using all of their human capacities to their fullest. The most important of these capacities is logos - a word that means "speech" and also means "reason" (it gives us the English word "logic"). Human beings alone have the ability to speak, and Aristotle says that we have been given that ability by nature so that we can speak and reason with each other to discover what is right and wrong, what is good and bad, and what is just and unjust.

Note that human beings discover these things rather than creating them. We do not get to decide what is right and wrong, but we do get to decide whether we will do what is right or what is wrong, and this is the most important decision we make in life. So too is the happy life: we do not get to decide what really makes us happy, although we do decide whether or not to pursue the happy life. And this is an ongoing decision. It is not made once and for all, but must be made over and over again as we live our lives. Aristotle believes that it is not easy to be virtuous, and he knows that becoming virtuous can only happen under the right conditions. Just as an acorn can only fulfill its telos if there is sufficient light, the right kind of soil, and enough water (among other things), and a horse can only fulfill its telos if there is sufficient food and room to run (again, among other things), an individual can only fulfill their telos and be a moral and happy human being within a well constructed political community. The community brings about virtue through education and through laws which prescribe certain actions and prohibit others.

And here we see the link between ethics and politics in a different light: the role of politics is to provide an environment in which people can live fully human, ethical, and happy lives, and this is the kind of life which makes it possible for someone to participate in politics in the correct way. As Aristotle says at Ethics1103a30: "We become just by the practice of just actions, self-controlled by exercising self-control, and courageous by performing acts of courage....Lawgivers make the citizens good by inculcating [good] habits in them, and this is the aim of every lawgiver; if he does not succeed in doing that, his legislation is a failure. It is in this that a good constitution differs from a bad one." This is not a view that would be found in political science textbooks today, but for Aristotle it is the central concern of the study of politics: how can we discover and put into practice the political institutions that will develop virtue in the citizens to the greatest possible extent?

6. The Text of the Politics

Having laid out the groundwork for Aristotle's thought, we are now in a position to look more closely at the text of the Politics. The translation we will use is that of Carnes Lord, which can be found in the list of suggested readings. This discussion is by no means complete; there is much of interest and value in Aristotle's political writings that will not be considered here. Again, the reader is encouraged to investigate the list of suggested readings. However, the main topics and problems of Aristotle's work will be included. The discussion will, to the extent possible, follow the organization of the Politics.

7. The Politics, Book I

a. The Purpose of the City

Aristotle begins the Politics by defining its subject, the city or political partnership. Doing so requires him to explain the purpose of the city. (The Greek word for city is polis, which is the word that gives us English words like "politics" and "policy"). Aristotle says that "It is clear that all partnerships aim at some good, and that the partnership that is most authoritative of all and embraces all the others does so particularly, and aims at the most authoritative good of all. This is what is called the city or the political partnership" (1252a3) (See also III.12). In Greece in Aristotle's time the important political entities were cities, which controlled surrounding territories that were farmed. It is important to remember that the city was not subordinate to a state or nation, the way that cities are today; it was sovereign over the territory that it controlled. To convey this, some translations use the word "city-state" in place of the world "polis." Although none of us today lives in a polis , we should not be too quick to dismiss Aristotle's observations on the way of life of the polis as irrelevant to our own political partnerships.

Notice that Aristotle does not define the political community in the way that we generally would, by the laws that it follows or by the group that holds power or as an entity controlling a particular territory. Instead he defines it as a partnership. The citizens of a political community are partners, and as with any other partnership they pursue a common good. In the case of the city it is the most authoritative or highest good. The most authoritative and highest good of all, for Aristotle, is the virtue and happiness of the citizens, and the purpose of the city is to make it possible for the citizens to achieve this virtue and happiness. When discussing the ideal city, he says "[A] city is excellent, at any rate, by its citizens' - those sharing in the regime – being excellent; and in our case all the citizens share in the regime" (1332a34). In achieving the virtue that is individual excellence, each of them will fulfill his telos. Indeed, it is the shared pursuit of virtue that makes a city a city.

As I have already noted at the beginning of this text, he says in the Ethics at 1099b30: "The end of politics is the best of ends; and the main concern of politics is to engender a certain character in the citizens and to make them good and disposed to perform noble actions." As has been mentioned, most people today would not see this as the main concern of politics, or even a legitimate concern. Certainly almost everyone wants to see law-abiding citizens, but it is questionable that changing the citizens' character or making them morally good is part of what government should do. Doing so would require far more governmental control over citizens than most people in Western societies are willing to allow.

Having seen Aristotle's definition of the city and its purpose, we then get an example of Aristotle's usual method of discussing political topics. He begins by examining opinions which are "generally accepted," which means, as he says in the Topics at 100b21, "are accepted by everyone or by the majority or by the philosophers - i.e. by all, or by the majority, or by the most notable and illustrious of them" on the grounds that any such opinions are likely to have at least some truth to them. These opinions (the Greek word isendoxa), however, are not completely true. They must be systematically examined and modified by scholars of politics before the truths that are part of these opinions are revealed. Because Aristotle uses this method of examining the opinions of others to arrive at truth, the reader must be careful to pay attention to whether a particular argument or belief is Aristotle's or not. In many cases he is setting out an argument in order to challenge it. It can be difficult to tell when Aristotle is arguing in his own voice and when he is considering the opinions of others, but the reader must carefully make this distinction if they are to understand Aristotle's teachings. (It has also been suggested that Aristotle's method should be seen as an example of how political discussion ought to be conducted: a variety of viewpoints and arguments are presented, and the final decision is arrived at through a consideration of the strengths and weaknesses of these viewpoints and arguments). For a further discussion of Aristotle’s methodology, see his discussion of reasoning in general and dialectical reasoning in particular in the Topics. Further examples of his approach can be found in Ethics I.4 and VII.1.

In this case, Aristotle takes up the popular opinion that political rule is really the same as other kinds of rule: that of kings over their subjects, of fathers over their wives and children, and of masters over their slaves. This opinion, he says, is mistaken. In fact, each of these kinds of rule is different. To see why, we must consider how the city comes into being, and it is to this that Aristotle next turns in Book I, Chapter 2.

b. How the City Comes Into Being

Here Aristotle tells the story of how cities have historically come into being. The first partnerships among human beings would have been between "persons who cannot exist without one another" (1252a27). There are two pairs of people for whom this is the case. One pair is that of male and female, for the sake of reproduction. This seems reasonable enough to the modern reader. The other pair, however, is that of "the naturally ruling and ruled, on account of preservation" (1252a30). Here Aristotle is referring to slavery. By "preservation" he means that the naturally ruling master and naturally ruled slave need each other if they are to preserve themselves; slavery is a kind of partnership which benefits both master and slave. We will see how later. For now, he simply says that these pairs of people come together and form a household, which exists for the purpose of meeting the needs of daily life (such as food, shelter, clothing, and so forth). The family is only large enough to provide for the bare necessities of life, sustaining its members' lives and allowing for the reproduction of the species.

Over time, the family expands, and as it does it will come into contact with other families. Eventually a number of such families combine and form a village. Villages are better than families because they are more self-sufficient. Because villages are larger than families, people can specialize in a wider array of tasks and can develop skills in things like cooking, medicine, building, soldiering, and so forth which they could not develop in a smaller group. So the residents of a village will live more comfortable lives, with access to more goods and services, than those who only live in families.

The significant change in human communities, however, comes when a number of villages combine to form a city. A city is not just a big village, but is fundamentally different: "The partnership arising from [the union of] several villages that is complete is the city. It reaches a level of full self-sufficiency, so to speak; and while coming into being for the sake of living, it exists for the sake of living well" (1252b27). Although the founders of cities create them for the sake of more comfortable lives, cities are unique in making it possible for people to live well. Today we tend to think of "living well" as living a life of comfort, family satisfaction, and professional success, surrounded by nice things. But this is not what Aristotle means by "living well". As we have seen, for Aristotle "living well" means leading a life of happiness and virtue, and by so doing fulfilling one's telos. Life in the city, in Aristotle’s view, is therefore necessary for anyone who wishes to be completely human. (His particular concern is with the free men who are citizens). "He who is without a city through nature rather than chance is either a mean sort or superior to man," Aristotle says (1253a3), and adds "One who is incapable of participating or who is in need of nothing through being self-sufficient is no part of a city, and so is either a beast or a god" (1253a27). Humans are not capable of becoming gods, but they are capable of becoming beasts, and in fact the worst kind of beasts: "For just as man is the best of the animals when completed, when separated from law and adjudication he is the worst of all" (1253a30). Outside of the context of life in a properly constructed city, human happiness and well-being is impossible. Even here at the very beginning of the Politics Aristotle is showing the link between ethics and politics and the importance of a well-constructed city in making it possible for the citizens to live well.

There is therefore a sense in which the city "is prior by nature to the household and to each of us" (1253a19). He compares the individual's relationship with the city to the relationship of a part of the body to the whole body. The destruction of the whole body would also mean the destruction of each of its parts; "if the whole [body] is destroyed there will not be a foot or a hand" (1253a20). And just as a hand is not able to survive without being attached to a functioning body, so too an individual cannot survive without being attached to a city. Presumably Aristotle also means to imply that the reverse is not true; a body can survive the loss of a foot or a hand, although not without consequence. Thus the individual needs the city more than the city needs any of its individual citizens; as Aristotle says in Book 8 before beginning his discussion of the desirable education for the city’s children, "one ought not even consider that a citizen belongs to himself, but rather that all belong to the city; for each individual is a part of the city" (1337a26).

If the history that he has described is correct, Aristotle points out, then the city is natural, and not purely an artificial human construction, since we have established that the first partnerships which make up the family are driven by natural impulses: "Every city, therefore, exists by nature, if such also are the first partnerships. For the city is their end….[T]he city belongs among the things that exist by nature, and…man is by nature a political animal" (1252b30-1253a3). From the very first partnerships of male and female and master and slave, nature has been aiming at the creation of cities, because cities are necessary for human beings to express their capacities and virtues at their best, thus fulfilling their potential and moving towards such perfection as is possible for human beings. While most people today would not agree that nature has a plan for individual human beings, a particular community, or humanity as a whole (although many people would ascribe such a plan to a god or gods), Aristotle believes that nature does indeed have such a plan, and human beings have unique attributes that when properly used make it possible for us to fulfill that plan. What are those attributes?

c. Man, the Political Animal

That man is much more a political animal than any kind of bee or any herd animal is clear. For, as we assert, nature does nothing in vain, and man alone among the animals has speech....[S]peech serves to reveal the advantageous and the harmful and hence also the just and unjust. For it is peculiar to man as compared to the other animals that he alone has a perception of good and bad and just and unjust and other things of this sort; and partnership in these things is what makes a household and a city (1253a8).

Like bees and herd animals, human beings live together in groups. Unlike bees or herd animals, humans have the capacity for speech - or, in the Greek, logos. As we have seen, logos means not only speech but also reason. Here the linkage between speech and reason is clear: the purpose of speech, a purpose assigned to men by nature, is to reveal what is advantageous and harmful, and by doing so to reveal what is good and bad, just and unjust. This knowledge makes it possible for human beings to live together, and at the same time makes it possible for us to pursue justice as part of the virtuous lives we are meant to live. Other animals living in groups, such as bees, goats, and cows, do not have the ability to speak or to reason as Aristotle uses those terms. Of course, they do not need this ability. They are able to live together without determining what is just and unjust or creating laws to enforce justice among themselves. Human beings, for better or worse, cannot do this.

Although nature brings us together - we are by nature political animals – nature alone does not give us all of what we need to live together: "[T]here is in everyone by nature an impulse toward this sort of partnership. And yet the one who first constituted [a city] is responsible for the greatest of goods" [1253a29]. We must figure out how to live together for ourselves through the use of reason and speech, discovering justice and creating laws that make it possible for human community to survive and for the individuals in it to live virtuous lives. A group of people that has done this is a city: "[The virtue of] justice is a thing belonging to the city. For adjudication is an arrangement of the political partnership, and adjudication is judgment as to what is just" (1253a38). And in discovering and living according to the right laws, acting with justice and exercising the virtues that allow human society to function, we make possible not only the success of the political community but also the flourishing of our own individual virtue and happiness. Without the city and its justice, human beings are the worst of animals, just as we are the best when we are completed by the right kind of life in the city. And it is the pursuit of virtue rather than the pursuit of wealth or security or safety or military strength that is the most important element of a city: "The political partnership must be regarded, therefore, as being for the sake of noble actions, not for the sake of living together" (1281a1).

d. Slavery

Having described the basic parts of the city, Aristotle returns in Chapter 3 of Book I to a discussion of the household, beginning with the matter of slavery, including the question of whether slavery is just (and hence an acceptable institution) or not. This, for most contemporary readers is one of the two most offensive portions of Aristotle's moral and political thought (the other is his treatment of women, about which more will be said below). For most people today, of course, the answer to this is obvious: slavery is not just, and in fact is one of the greatest injustices and moral crimes that it is possible to commit. (Although it is not widely known, there are still large numbers of people held in slavery throughout the world at the beginning of the 21st century. It is easy to believe that people in the "modern world" have put a great deal of moral distance between themselves and the less enlightened people in the past, but it is also easy to overestimate that distance).

In Aristotle's time most people - at least the ones that were not themselves slaves – would also have believed that this question had an obvious answer, if they had asked the question at all: of course slavery is just. Virtually every ancient Mediterranean culture had some form of the institution of slavery. Slaves were usually of two kinds: either they had at one point been defeated in war, and the fact that they had been defeated meant that they were inferior and meant to serve, or else they were the children of slaves, in which case their inferiority was clear from their inferior parentage. Aristotle himself says that the sort of war that involves hunting "those human beings who are naturally suited to be ruled but [are] unwilling…[is] by nature just" (1256b25). What is more, the economies of the Greek city-states rested on slavery, and without slaves (and women) to do the productive labor, there could be no leisure for men to engage in more intellectual lifestyles. The greatness of Athenian plays, architecture, sculpture, and philosophy could not have been achieved without the institution of slavery. Therefore, as a practical matter, regardless of the arguments for or against it, slavery was not going to be abolished in the Greek world. Aristotle’s willingness to consider the justice of slavery, however we might see it, was in fact progressive for the time. It is perhaps also worth noting that Aristotle’s will specified that his slaves should be freed upon his death. This is not to excuse Aristotle or those of his time who supported slavery, but it should be kept in mind so as to give Aristotle a fair hearing.

Before considering Aristotle's ultimate position on the justness of slavery - for who, and under what circumstances, slavery is appropriate – it must be pointed out that there is a great deal of disagreement about what that position is. That Aristotle believes slavery to be just and good for both master and slave in some circumstances is undeniable. That he believes that some people who are currently enslaved are not being held in slavery according to justice is also undeniable (this would apparently also mean that there are people who should be enslaved but currently are not). How we might tell which people belong in which group, and what Aristotle believes the consequences of his beliefs about slavery ought to be, are more difficult problems.

Remember that in his discussion of the household, Aristotle has said that slavery serves the interest of both the master and the slave. Now he tells us why: "those who are as different [from other men] as the soul from the body or man from beast - and they are in this state if their work is the use of the body, and if this is the best that can come from them – are slaves by nature….For he is a slave by nature who is capable of belonging to another – which is also why he belongs to another – and who participates in reason only to the extent of perceiving it, but does not have it" (1254b16-23). Notice again the importance of logos – reason and speech. Those who are slaves by nature do not have the full ability to reason. (Obviously they are not completely helpless or unable to reason; in the case of slaves captured in war, for example, the slaves were able to sustain their lives into adulthood and organize themselves into military forces. Aristotle also promises a discussion of "why it is better to hold out freedom as a reward for all slaves" (1330a30) which is not in the Politics as we have it, but if slaves were not capable of reasoning well enough to stay alive it would not be a good thing to free them). They are incapable of fully governing their own lives, and require other people to tell them what to do. Such people should be set to labor by the people who have the ability to reason fully and order their own lives. Labor is their proper use; Aristotle refers to slaves as "living tools" at I.4. Slaves get the guidance and instructions that they must have to live, and in return they provide the master with the benefits of their physical labor, not least of which is the free time that makes it possible for the master to engage in politics and philosophy.

One of the themes running through Aristotle's thought that most people would reject today is the idea that a life of labor is demeaning and degrading, so that those who must work for a living are not able to be as virtuous as those who do not have to do such work. Indeed, Aristotle says that when the master can do so he avoids labor even to the extent of avoiding the oversight of those who must engage in it: "[F]or those to whom it is open not to be bothered with such things [i.e. managing slaves], an overseer assumes this prerogative, while they themselves engage in politics or philosophy" (1255b35).

This would seem to legitimate slavery, and yet there are two significant problems.

First, Aristotle points out that although nature would like us to be able to differentiate between who is meant to be a slave and who is meant to be a master by making the difference in reasoning capacity visible in their outward appearances, it frequently does not do so. We cannot look at people's souls and distinguish those who are meant to rule from those who are meant to be ruled - and this will also cause problems when Aristotle turns to the question of who has a just claim to rule in the city.

Second, in Chapter Six, Aristotle points out that not everyone currently held in slavery is in fact a slave by nature. The argument that those who are captured in war are inferior in virtue cannot, as far as Aristotle is concerned, be sustained, and the idea that the children of slaves are meant to be slaves is also wrong: "[T]hey claim that from the good should come someone good, just as from a human being comes from a human being and a beast from beasts. But while nature wishes to do this, it is often unable to" (1255b3). We are left with the position that while some people are indeed slaves by nature, and that slavery is good for them, it is extremely difficult to find out who these people are, and that therefore it is not the case that slavery is automatically just either for people taken in war or for children of slaves, though sometimes it is (1256b23). In saying this, Aristotle was undermining the legitimacy of the two most significant sources of slaves. If Aristotle's personal life is relevant, while he himself owned slaves, he was said to have freed them upon his death. Whether this makes Aristotle’s position on slavery more acceptable or less so is left to the reader to decide.

In Chapter 8 of Book I Aristotle says that since we have been talking about household possessions such as slaves we might as well continue this discussion. The discussion turns to "expertise in household management." The Greek word for "household" is oikos, and it is the source of our word "economics." In Aristotle's day almost all productive labor took place within the household, unlike today, in modern capitalist societies, when it mostly takes place in factories, offices, and other places specifically developed for such activity.

Aristotle uses the discussion of household management to make a distinction between expertise in managing a household and expertise in business. The former, Aristotle says, is important both for the household and the city; we must have supplies available of the things that are necessary for life, such as food, clothing, and so forth, and because the household is natural so too is the science of household management, the job of which is to maintain the household. The latter, however, is potentially dangerous. This, obviously, is another major difference between Aristotle and contemporary Western societies, which respect and admire business expertise, and encourage many of our citizens to acquire and develop such expertise. For Aristotle, however, expertise in business is not natural, but "arises rather through a certain experience and art" (1257a5). It is on account of expertise in business that "there is held to be no limit to wealth and possessions" (1257a1). This is a problem because some people are led to pursue wealth without limit, and the choice of such a life, while superficially very attractive, does not lead to virtue and real happiness. It leads some people to "proceed on the supposition that they should either preserve or increase without limit their property in money. The cause of this state is that they are serious about living, but not about living well; and since that desire of theirs is without limit, they also desire what is productive of unlimited things" (1257b38).

Aristotle does not entirely condemn wealth - it is necessary for maintaining the household and for providing the opportunity to develop one's virtue. For example, generosity is one of the virtues listed in the Ethics, but it is impossible to be generous unless one has possessions to give away. But Aristotle strongly believes that we must not lose sight of the fact that wealth is to be pursued for the sake of living a virtuous life, which is what it means to live well, rather than for its own sake. (So at 1258b1 he agrees with those who object to the lending of money for interest, upon which virtually the entire modern global economy is based). Someone who places primary importance on money and the bodily satisfactions that it can buy is not engaged in developing their virtue and has chosen a life which, however it may seem from the outside or to the person living it, is not a life of true happiness.

This is still another difference between Aristotle and contemporary Western societies. For many if not most people in such societies, the pursuit of wealth without limit is seen as not only acceptable but even admirable. At the same time, many people reject the emphasis Aristotle places on the importance of political participation. Many liberal democracies fail to get even half of their potential voters to cast a ballot at election time, and jury duty, especially in the United States, is often looked on as a burden and waste of time, rather than a necessary public service that citizens should willingly perform. In Chapter 11, Aristotle notes that there is a lot more to be said about enterprise in business, but "to spend much time on such things is crude" (1258b35). Aristotle believes that we ought to be more concerned with other matters; moneymaking is beneath the attention of the virtuous man. (In this Aristotle is in agreement with the common opinion of Athenian aristocrats). He concludes this discussion with a story about Thales the philosopher using his knowledge of astronomy to make a great deal of money, "thus showing how easy it is for philosophers to become wealthy if they so wish, but it is not this they are serious about" (1259a16). Their intellectual powers, which could be turned to wealth, are being used in other, better ways to develop their humanity.

In the course of discussing the various ways of life open to human beings, Aristotle notes that "If, then, nature makes nothing that is incomplete or purposeless, nature must necessarily have made all of these [i.e. all plants and animals] for the sake of human beings" (1256b21). Though not a directly political statement, it does emphasize Aristotle's belief that there are many hierarchies in nature, as well as his belief that those who are lower in the natural hierarchy should be under the command of those who are higher.

e. Women

In Chapter 12, after the discussion of business expertise has been completed, Aristotle returns to the subject of household rule, and takes up the question of the proper forms of rule over women and children. As with the master's rule over the slave, and humanity’s rule over plants and other animals, Aristotle defines these kinds of rule in terms of natural hierarchies: "[T]he male, unless constituted in some respect contrary to nature, is by nature more expert at leading than the female, and the elder and complete than the younger and incomplete" (1259a41). This means that it is natural for the male to rule: "[T]he relation of male to female is by nature a relation of superior to inferior and ruler to ruled" (1245b12). And just as with the rule of the master over the slave, the difference here is one of reason: "The slave is wholly lacking the deliberative element; the female has it but it lacks authority; the child has it but it is incomplete" (1260a11).

There is a great deal of scholarly debate about what the phrase "lacks authority" means in this context. Aristotle does not elaborate on it. Some have suggested that it means not that women's reason is inferior to that of men but that women lack the ability to make men do what they want, either because of some innate psychological characteristic (they are not aggressive and/or assertive enough) or because of the prevailing culture in Greece at the time. Others suggest that it means that women’s emotions are ultimately more influential in determining their behavior than reason is so that reason lacks authority over what a woman does. This question cannot be settled here. I will simply point out the vicious circle in which women were trapped in ancient Greece (and still are in many cultures). The Greeks believed that women are inferior to men (or at least those Greeks who wrote philosophy, plays, speeches, and so forth did. These people, of course, were all men. What Greek women thought of this belief is impossible to say). This belief means that women are denied access to certain areas of life (such as politics). Denying them access to these spheres means that they fail to develop the knowledge and skills to become proficient in them. This lack of knowledge and skills then becomes evidence to reinforce the original belief that they are inferior.

What else does Aristotle have to say about the rule of men over women? He says that the rule of the male over the female and that of the father over children are different in form from the rule of masters over slaves. Aristotle places the rule of male over female in the household in the context of the husband over the wife (female children who had not yet been married would have been ruled by their father. Marriage for girls in Athens typically took place at the age of thirteen or fourteen). Aristotle says at 1259a40 that the wife is to be ruled in political fashion. We have not yet seen what political rule looks like, but here Aristotle notes several of its important features, one of which is that it usually involves "alternation in ruling and being ruled" (1259b2), and another is that it involves rule among those who "tend by their nature to be on an equal footing and to differ in nothing" (1259b5). In this case, however, the husband does not alternate rule with the wife but instead always rules. Apparently the husband is to treat his wife as an equal to the degree that it is possible to do so, but must retain ultimate control over household decisions.

Women have their own role in the household, preserving what the man acquires. However, women do not participate in politics, since their reason lacks the authority that would allow them to do so, and in order to properly fulfill this role the wife must pursue her own telos. This is not the same as that of a man, but as with a man nature intends her to achieve virtues of the kind that are available to her: "It is thus evident that…the moderation of a woman and a man is not the same, nor their courage or justice…but that there is a ruling and a serving courage, and similarly with the other virtues" (1260a19). Unfortunately Aristotle has very little to say about what women's virtues look like, how they are to be achieved, or how women should be educated. But it is clear that Aristotle believes that as with the master's superiority to the slave, the man's superiority to a woman is dictated by nature and cannot be overcome by human laws, customs, or beliefs.

Aristotle concludes the discussion of household rule, and the first book of the Politics, by stating that the discussion here is not complete and "must necessarily be addressed in the [discourses] connected with the regimes" (1260a11). This is the case because both women and children "must necessarily be educated looking to the regime, at least if it makes any difference with a view to the city's being excellent that both its children and its women are excellent. But it necessarily makes a difference…" (1260a14). "Regime" is one of the ways to translate the Greek word politeia, which is also often translated as "constitution" or "political system." Although there is some controversy about how best to translate this word, I will use the word "regime" throughout this article. The reader should keep in mind that if the word "constitution" is used this does not mean a written constitution of the sort that most contemporary nation-states employ. Instead, Aristotle uses politeia (however it is translated) to mean the way the state is organized, what offices there are, who is eligible to hold them, how they are selected, and so forth. All of these things depend on the group that holds political power in the city. For example, sometimes power is held by one man who rules in the interest of the city as a whole; this is the kind of regime called monarchy. If power is held by the wealthy who rule for their own benefit, then the regime is an oligarchy.

We will have much more to say later on the topic of regimes. Here Aristotle is introducing another important idea which he will develop later: the idea that the people living under a regime, including the women and children, must be taught to believe in the principles that underlie that regime. (In Book II, Chapter 9, Aristotle severely criticizes the Spartan regime for its failure to properly educate the Spartan women and shows the negative consequences this has had for the Spartan regime). For a monarchy to last, for example, the people must believe in the rightness of monarchical rule and the principles which justify it. Therefore it is important for the monarch to teach the people these principles and beliefs. In Books IV-VI Aristotle develops in much more detail what the principles of the different regimes are, and the Politics concludes with a discussion of the kind of education that the best regime ought to provide its citizens.

8. The Politics, Book II

"Cities…that are held to be in a fine condition" In Book II, Aristotle changes his focus from the household to the consideration of regimes that are "in use in some of the cities that are said to be well managed and any others spoken about by certain persons that are held to be in a fine condition" (1260a30). This examination of existing cities must be done both in order to find out what those cities do properly, so that their successes can be imitated, and to find out what they do improperly so that we can learn from their mistakes. This study and the use of the knowledge it brings remains one of the important tasks of political science. Merely imitating an existing regime, no matter how excellent its reputation, is not sufficient. This is the case "because those regimes now available are in fact not in a fine condition" (1260a34). In order to create a better regime we must study the imperfect ones found in the real world. He will do this again on a more theoretical level in Books IV-VI. We should also examine the ideal regimes proposed by other thinkers. As it turns out, however fine these regimes are in theory, they cannot be put into practice, and this is obviously reason enough not to adopt them. Nevertheless, the ideas of other thinkers can assist us in our search for knowledge. Keep in mind that the practical sciences are not about knowledge for its own sake: unless we put this knowledge to use in order to improve the citizens and the city, the study engaged in by political science is pointless. We will not consider all the details of the different regimes Aristotle describes, but some of them are important enough to examine here.

a. What Kind of Partnership Is a City?

Aristotle begins his exploration of these regimes with the question of the degree to which the citizens in a regime should be partners. Recall that he opened the Politics with the statement that the city is a partnership, and in fact the most authoritative partnership. The citizens of a particular city clearly share something, because it is sharing that makes a partnership. Consider some examples of partnerships: business partners share a desire for wealth; philosophers share a desire for knowledge; drinking companions share a desire for entertainment; the members of a hockey team share a desire to win their game.

So what is it that citizens share? This is an important question for Aristotle, and he chooses to answer this question in the context of Socrates' imagined community in Plato's dialogue The Republic. Aristotle has already said that the regime is a partnership in adjudication and justice. But is it enough that the people of a city have a shared understanding of what justice means and what the laws require, or is the political community a partnership in more than these things? Today the answer would probably be that these things are sufficient - a group of people sharing territory and laws is not far from how most people would define the modern state. In the Republic, Socrates argues that the city should be unified to the greatest degree possible. The citizens, or at least those in the ruling class, ought to share everything, including property, women, and children. There should be no private families and no private property. But this, according to Aristotle, is too much sharing. While the city is clearly a kind of unity, it is a unity that must derive from a multitude. Human beings are unavoidably different, and this difference, as we saw earlier, is the reason cities were formed in the first place, because difference within the city allows for specialization and greater self-sufficiency. Cities are preserved not by complete unity and similarity but by "reciprocal equality," and this principle is especially important in cities where "persons are free and equal." In such cities "all cannot rule at the same time, but each rules for a year or according to some other arrangement or period of time. In this way, then, it results that all rule…" (1261a30). This topic, the alternation of rule in cities where the citizens are free and equal, is an important part of Aristotle's thought, and we will return to it later.

There would be another drawback to creating a city in which everything is held in common. Aristotle notes that people value and care for what is their own: "What belongs in common to the most people is accorded the least care: they take thought for their own things above all, and less about things common, or only so much as falls to each individually" (1261b32). (Contemporary social scientists call this a problem of "collective goods"). Therefore to hold women and property in common, as Socrates proposes, would be a mistake. It would weaken attachments to other people and to the common property of the city, and this would lead to each individual assuming that someone else would care for the children and property, with the end result being that no one would. For a modern example, many people who would not throw trash on their own front yard or damage their own furniture will litter in a public park and destroy the furniture in a rented apartment or dorm room. Some in Aristotle's time (and since) have suggested that holding property in common will lead to an end to conflict in the city. This may at first seem wise, since the unequal distribution of property in a political community is, Aristotle believes, one of the causes of injustice in the city and ultimately of civil war. But in fact it is not the lack of common property that leads to conflict; instead, Aristotle blames human depravity (1263b20). And in order to deal with human depravity, what is needed is to moderate human desires, which can be done among those "adequately educated by the laws" (1266b31). Inequality of property leads to problems because the common people desire wealth without limit (1267b3); if this desire can be moderated, so too can the problems that arise from it. Aristotle also includes here the clam that the citizens making up the elite engage in conflict because of inequality of honors (1266b38). In other words, they engage in conflict with the other citizens because of their desire for an unequal share of honor, which leads them to treat the many with condescension and arrogance. Holding property in common, Aristotle notes, will not remove the desire for honor as a source of conflict.

b. Existing Cities: Sparta, Crete, Carthage

In Chapters 9-11 of Book II, Aristotle considers existing cities that are held to be excellent: Sparta in Chapter 9, Crete in Chapter 10, and Carthage (which, notably, was not a Greek city) in Chapter 11. It is noteworthy that when Athens is considered following this discussion (in Chapter 12), Aristotle takes a critical view and seems to suggest that the city has declined since the time of Solon. Aristotle does not anywhere in his writings suggest that Athens is the ideal city or even the best existing city. It is easy to assume the opposite, and many have done so, but there is no basis for this assumption. We will not examine the particulars of Aristotle's view of each of these cities. However, two important points should be noted here. One general point that Aristotle makes when considering existing regimes is that when considering whether a particular piece of legislation is good or not, it must be compared not only to the best possible set of arrangements but also the set of arrangements that actually prevails in the city. If a law does not fit well with the principles of the regime, although it may be an excellent law in the abstract, the people will not believe in it or support it and as a result it will be ineffective or actually harmful (1269a31). The other is that Aristotle is critical of the Spartans because of their belief that the most important virtue to develop and the one that the city must teach its citizens is the kind of virtue that allows them to make war successfully. But war is not itself an end or a good thing; war is for the sake of peace, and the inability of the Spartans to live virtuously in times of peace has led to their downfall. (See also Book VII, Chapter 2, where Aristotle notes the hypocrisy of a city whose citizens seek justice among themselves but "care nothing about justice towards others" (1324b35) and Book VII, Chapter 15).

9. The Politics, Book III

a. Who Is the Citizen?

In Book III, Aristotle takes a different approach to understanding the city. Again he takes up the question of what the city actually is, but here his method is to understand the parts that make up the city: the citizens. "Thus who ought to be called a citizen and what the citizen is must be investigated" (1274b41). For Americans today this is a legal question: anyone born in the United States or born to American citizens abroad is automatically a citizen. Other people can become citizens by following the correct legal procedures for doing so. However, this rule is not acceptable for Aristotle, since slaves are born in the same cities as free men but that does not make them citizens. For Aristotle, there is more to citizenship than living in a particular place or sharing in economic activity or being ruled under the same laws. Instead, citizenship for Aristotle is a kind of activity: "The citizen in an unqualified sense is defined by no other thing so much as by sharing in decision and office" (1275a22). Later he says that "Whoever is entitled to participate in an office involving deliberation or decision is, we can now say, a citizen in this city; and the city is the multitude of such persons that is adequate with a view to a self-sufficient life, to speak simply" (1275b17). And this citizen is a citizen "above all in a democracy; he may, but will not necessarily, be a citizen in the others" (1275b4). We have yet to talk about what a democracy is, but when we do, this point will be important to defining it properly. When Aristotle talks about participation, he means that each citizen should participate directly in the assembly - not by voting for representatives – and should willingly serve on juries to help uphold the laws. Note again the contrast with modern Western nation-states where there are very few opportunities to participate directly in politics and most people struggle to avoid serving on juries.

Participation in deliberation and decision making means that the citizen is part of a group that discusses the advantageous and the harmful, the good and bad, and the just and unjust, and then passes laws and reaches judicial decisions based on this deliberative process. This process requires that each citizen consider the various possible courses of action on their merits and discuss these options with his fellow citizens. By doing so the citizen is engaging in reason and speech and is therefore fulfilling his telos, engaged in the process that enables him to achieve the virtuous and happy life. In regimes where the citizens are similar and equal by nature - which in practice is all of them – all citizens should be allowed to participate in politics, though not all at once. They must take turns, ruling and being ruled in turn. Note that this means that citizenship is not just a set of privileges, it is also a set of duties. The citizen has certain freedoms that non-citizens do not have, but he also has obligations (political participation and military service) that they do not have. We will see shortly why Aristotle believed that the cities existing at the time did not in fact follow this principle of ruling and being ruled in turn.

b. The Good Citizen and the Good Man

Before looking more closely at democracy and the other kinds of regimes, there are still several important questions to be discussed in Book III. One of the most important of these from Aristotle's point of view is in Chapter 4. Here he asks the question of "whether the virtue of the good man and the excellent citizen is to be regarded as the same or as not the same" (1276b15). This is a question that seems strange, or at least irrelevant, to most people today. The good citizen today is asked to follow the laws, pay taxes, and possibly serve on juries; these are all good things the good man (or woman) would do, so that the good citizen is seen as being more or less subsumed into the category of the good person. For Aristotle, however, this is not the case. We have already seen Aristotle's definition of the good man: the one who pursues his telos, living a life in accordance with virtue and finding happiness by doing so. What is Aristotle's definition of the good citizen?

Aristotle has already told us that if the regime is going to endure it must educate all the citizens in such a way that they support the kind of regime that it is and the principles that legitimate it. Because there are several different types of regime (six, to be specific, which will be considered in more detail shortly), there are several different types of good citizen. Good citizens must have the type of virtue that preserves the partnership and the regime: "[A]lthough citizens are dissimilar, preservation of the partnership is their task, and the regime is [this] partnership; hence the virtue of the citizen must necessarily be with a view to the regime. If, then, there are indeed several forms of regime, it is clear that it is not possible for the virtue of the excellent citizen to be single, or complete virtue" (1276b27).

There is only one situation in which the virtue of the good citizen and excellent man are the same, and this is when the citizens are living in a city that is under the ideal regime: "In the case of the best regime, [the citizen] is one who is capable of and intentionally chooses being ruled and ruling with a view to the life in accordance with virtue" (1284a1). Aristotle does not fully describe this regime until Book VII. For those of us not living in the ideal regime, the ideal citizen is one who follows the laws and supports the principles of the regime, whatever that regime is. That this may well require us to act differently than the good man would act and to believe things that the good man knows to be false is one of the unfortunate tragedies of political life.

There is another element to determining who the good citizen is, and it is one that we today would not support. For Aristotle, remember, politics is about developing the virtue of the citizens and making it possible for them to live a life of virtue. We have already seen that women and slaves are not capable of living this kind of life, although each of these groups has its own kind of virtue to pursue. But there is another group that is incapable of citizenship leading to virtue, and Aristotle calls this group "the vulgar". These are the people who must work for a living. Such people lack the leisure time necessary for political participation and the study of philosophy: "it is impossible to pursue the things of virtue when one lives the life of a vulgar person or a laborer" (1278a20). They are necessary for the city to exist - someone must build the houses, make the shoes, and so forth – but in the ideal city they would play no part in political life because their necessary tasks prevent them from developing their minds and taking an active part in ruling the city. Their existence, like those of the slaves and the women, is for the benefit of the free male citizens. Aristotle makes this point several times in the Politics: see, for example, VII.9 and VIII.2 for discussions of the importance of avoiding the lifestyle of the vulgar if one wants to achieve virtue, and I.13 and III.4, where those who work with their hands are labeled as kinds of slaves.

The citizens, therefore, are those men who are "similar in stock and free," (1277b8) and rule over such men by those who are their equals is political rule, which is different from the rule of masters over slaves, men over women, and parents over children. This is one of Aristotle's most important points: "[W]hen [the regime] is established in accordance with equality and similarity among the citizens, [the citizens] claim to merit ruling in turn" (1279a8). Throughout the remainder of the Politics he returns to this point to remind us of the distinction between a good regime and a bad regime. The correct regime of polity, highlighted in Book IV, is under political rule, while deviant regimes are those which are ruled as though a master was ruling over slaves. But this is wrong: "For in the case of persons similar by nature, justice and merit must necessarily be the same according to nature; and so if it is harmful for their bodies if unequal persons have equal sustenance and clothing, it is so also [for their souls if they are equal] in what pertains to honors, and similarly therefore if equal persons have what is unequal" (1287a12).

c. Who Should Rule?

This brings us to perhaps the most contentious of political questions: how should the regime be organized? Another way of putting this is: who should rule? In Books IV-VI Aristotle explores this question by looking at the kinds of regimes that actually existed in the Greek world and answering the question of who actually does rule. By closely examining regimes that actually exist, we can draw conclusions about the merits and drawbacks of each. Like political scientists today, he studied the particular political phenomena of his time in order to draw larger conclusions about how regimes and political institutions work and how they should work. As has been mentioned above, in order to do this, he sent his students throughout Greece to collect information on the regimes and histories of the Greek cities, and he uses this information throughout the Politics to provide examples that support his arguments. (According to Diogenes Laertius, histories and descriptions of the regimes of 158 cities were written, but only one of these has come down to the present: the Constitution of Athens mentioned above).

Another way he used this data was to create a typology of regimes that was so successful that it ended up being used until the time of Machiavelli nearly 2000 years later. He used two criteria to sort the regimes into six categories.

The first criterion that is used to distinguish among different kinds of regimes is the number of those ruling: one man, a few men, or the many. The second is perhaps a little more unexpected: do those in power, however many they are, rule only in their own interest or do they rule in the interest of all the citizens? "[T]hose regimes which look to the common advantage are correct regimes according to what is unqualifiedly just, while those which look only to the advantage of the rulers are errant, and are all deviations from the correct regimes; for they involve mastery, but the city is a partnership of free persons" (1279a16).

Having established these as the relevant criteria, in Book III Chapter 7 Aristotle sets out the six kinds of regimes. The correct regimes are monarchy (rule by one man for the common good), aristocracy (rule by a few for the common good), and polity (rule by the many for the common good); the flawed or deviant regimes are tyranny (rule by one man in his own interest), oligarchy (rule by the few in their own interest), and democracy (rule by the many in their own interest). Aristotle later ranks them in order of goodness, with monarchy the best, aristocracy the next best, then polity, democracy, oligarchy, and tyranny (1289a38). People in Western societies are used to thinking of democracy as a good form of government - maybe the only good form of government – but Aristotle considers it one of the flawed regimes (although it is the least bad of the three) and you should keep that in mind in his discussion of it. You should also keep in mind that by the "common good" Aristotle means the common good of the citizens, and not necessarily all the residents of the city. The women, slaves, and manual laborers are in the city for the good of the citizens.

Almost immediately after this typology is created, Aristotle clarifies it: the real distinction between oligarchy and democracy is in fact the distinction between whether the wealthy or the poor rule (1279b39), not whether the many or the few rule. Since it is always the case that the poor are many while the wealthy are few, it looks like it is the number of the rulers rather than their wealth which distinguishes the two kinds of regimes (he elaborates on this in IV.4). All cities have these two groups, the many poor and the few wealthy, and Aristotle was well aware that it was the conflict between these two groups that caused political instability in the cities, even leading to civil wars (Thucydides describes this in his History of the Peloponnesian War, and the Constitution of Athens also discusses the consequences of this conflict). Aristotle therefore spends a great deal of time discussing these two regimes and the problem of political instability, and we will focus on this problem as well.

First, however, let us briefly consider with Aristotle one other valid claim to rule. Those who are most virtuous have, Aristotle says, the strongest claim of all to rule. If the city exists for the sake of developing virtue in the citizens, then those who have the most virtue are the most fit to rule; they will rule best, and on behalf of all the citizens, establishing laws that lead others to virtue. However, if one man or a few men of exceptional virtue exist in the regime, we will be outside of politics: "If there is one person so outstanding by his excess of virtue - or a number of persons, though not enough to provide a full complement for the city – that the virtue of all the others and their political capacity is not commensurable…such persons can no longer be regarded as part of the city" (1284a4). It would be wrong for the other people in the city to claim the right to rule over them or share rule with them, just as it would be wrong for people to claim the right to share power with Zeus. The proper thing would be to obey them (1284b28). But this situation is extremely unlikely (1287b40). Instead, cities will be made up of people who are similar and equal, which leads to problems of its own.

The most pervasive of these is that oligarchs and democrats each advance a claim to political power based on justice. For Aristotle, justice dictates that equal people should get equal things, and unequal people should get unequal things. If, for example, two students turn in essays of identical quality, they should each get the same grade. Their work is equal, and so the reward should be too. If they turn in essays of different quality, they should get different grades which reflect the differences in their work. But the standards used for grading papers are reasonably straightforward, and the consequences of this judgment are not that important, relatively speaking - they certainly are not worth fighting and dying for. But the stakes are raised when we ask how we should judge the question of who should rule, for the standards here are not straightforward and disagreement over the answer to this question frequently does lead men (and women) to fight and die.

What does justice require when political power is being distributed? Aristotle says that both groups - the oligarchs and democrats – offer judgments about this, but neither of them gets it right, because "the judgment concerns themselves, and most people are bad judges concerning their own things" (1280a14). (This was the political problem that was of most concern to the authors of the United States Constitution: given that people are self-interested and ambitious, who can be trusted with power? Their answer differs from Aristotle's, but it is worth pointing out the persistence of the problem and the difficulty of solving it). The oligarchs assert that their greater wealth entitles them to greater power, which means that they alone should rule, while the democrats say that the fact that all are equally free entitles each citizen to an equal share of political power (which, because most people are poor, means that in effect the poor rule). If the oligarchs' claim seems ridiculous, you should keep in mind that the American colonies had property qualifications for voting; those who could not prove a certain level of wealth were not allowed to vote. And poll taxes, which required people to pay a tax in order to vote and therefore kept many poor citizens (including almost all African-Americans) from voting, were not eliminated in the United States until the mid-20th century. At any rate, each of these claims to rule, Aristotle says, is partially correct but partially wrong. We will consider the nature of democracy and oligarchy shortly.

Aristotle also in Book III argues for a principle that has become one of the bedrock principles of liberal democracy: we ought, to the extent possible, allow the law to rule. "One who asks the law to rule, therefore, is held to be asking god and intellect alone to rule, while one who asks man adds the beast. Desire is a thing of this sort; and spiritedness perverts rulers and the best men. Hence law is intellect without appetite" (1287a28). This is not to say that the law is unbiased. It will reflect the bias of the regime, as it must, because the law reinforces the principles of the regime and helps educate the citizens in those principles so that they will support the regime. But in any particular case, the law, having been established in advance, is impartial, whereas a human judge will find it hard to resist judging in his own interest, according to his own desires and appetites, which can easily lead to injustice. Also, if this kind of power is left in the hands of men rather than with the laws, there will be a desperate struggle to control these offices and their benefits, and this will be another cause of civil war. So whatever regime is in power should, to the extent possible, allow the laws to rule. Ruling in accordance with one's wishes at any particular time is one of the hallmarks of tyranny (it is the same way masters rule over slaves), and it is also, Aristotle says, typical of a certain kind of democracy, which rules by decree rather than according to settled laws. In these cases we are no longer dealing with politics at all, "For where the laws do not rule there is no regime" (1292b30). There are masters and slaves, but there are no citizens.

10. The Politics, Book IV

a. Polity: The Best Practical Regime

In Book IV Aristotle continues to think about existing regimes and their limitations, focusing on the question: what is the best possible regime? This is another aspect of political science that is still practiced today, as Aristotle combines a theory about how regimes ought to be with his analysis of how regimes really are in practice in order to prescribe changes to those regimes that will bring them more closely in line with the ideal. It is in Book VII that Aristotle describes the regime that would be absolutely the best, if we could have everything the way we wanted it; here he is considering the best regime that we can create given the kinds of human beings and circumstances that cities today find themselves forced to deal with, "For one should study not only the best regime but also the regime that is [the best] possible, and similarly also the regime that is easier and more attainable for all" (1288b37).

Aristotle also provides advice for those that want to preserve any of the existing kinds of regime, even the defective ones, showing a kind of hard-headed realism that is often overlooked in his writings. In order to do this, he provides a higher level of detail about the varieties of the different regimes than he has previously given us. There are a number of different varieties of democracy and oligarchy because cities are made up of a number of different groups of people, and the regime will be different depending on which of these groups happens to be most authoritative. For example, a democracy that is based on the farming element will be different than a democracy that is based on the element that is engaged in commerce, and similarly there are different kinds of oligarchies. We do not need to consider these in detail except to note that Aristotle holds to his position that in either a democracy or an oligarchy it is best if the law rules rather than the people possessing power. In the case of democracy it is best if the farmers rule, because farmers will not have the time to attend the assembly, so they will stay away and will let the laws rule (VI.4).

It is, however, important to consider polity in some detail, and this is the kind of regime to which Aristotle next turns his attention. "Simply speaking, polity is a mixture of oligarchy and democracy" (1293a32). Remember that polity is one of the correct regimes, and it occurs when the many rule in the interest of the political community as a whole. The problem with democracy as the rule of the many is that in a democracy the many rule in their own interest; they exploit the wealthy and deny them political power. But a democracy in which the interests of the wealthy were taken into account and protected by the laws would be ruling in the interest of the community as a whole, and it is this that Aristotle believes is the best practical regime. The ideal regime to be described in Book VII is the regime that we would pray for if the gods would grant us our wishes and we could create a city from scratch, having everything exactly the way we would want it. But when we are dealing with cities that already exist, their circumstances limit what kind of regime we can reasonably expect to create. Creating a polity is a difficult thing to do, and although he provides many examples of democracies and oligarchies Aristotle does not give any examples of existing polities or of polities that have existed in the past.

One of the important elements of creating a polity is to combine the institutions of a democracy with those of an oligarchy. For example, in a democracy, citizens are paid to serve on juries, while in an oligarchy, rich people are fined if they do not. In a polity, both of these approaches are used, with the poor being paid to serve and the rich fined for not serving. In this way, both groups will serve on juries and power will be shared. There are several ways to mix oligarchy and democracy, but "The defining principle of a good mixture of democracy and oligarchy is that it should be possible for the same polity to be spoken of as either a democracy or an oligarchy" (1294b14). The regime must be said to be both - and neither – a democracy and an oligarchy, and it will be preserved "because none of the parts of the city generally would wish to have another regime" (1294b38).

b. The Importance of the Middle Class

In addition to combining elements from the institutions of democracy and oligarchy, the person wishing to create a lasting polity must pay attention to the economic situation in the city. In Book II of the EthicsAristotle famously establishes the principle that virtue is a mean between two extremes. For example, a soldier who flees before a battle is guilty of the vice of cowardice, while one who charges the enemy singlehandedly, breaking ranks and getting himself killed for no reason, is guilty of the vice of foolhardiness. The soldier who practices the virtue of courage is the one who faces the enemy, moves forward with the rest of the troops in good order, and fights bravely. Courage, then, is a mean between the extremes of cowardice and foolhardiness. The person who has it neither flees from the enemy nor engages in a suicidal and pointless attack but faces the enemy bravely and attacks in the right way.

Aristotle draws a parallel between virtue in individuals and virtue in cities. The city, he says, has three parts: the rich, the poor, and the middle class. Today we would probably believe that it is the rich people who are the most fortunate of those three groups, but this is not Aristotle's position. He says: "[I]t is evident that in the case of the goods of fortune as well a middling possession is the best of all. For [a man of moderate wealth] is readiest to obey reason, while for one who is [very wealthy or very poor] it is difficult to follow reason. The former sort tend to become arrogant and base on a grand scale, the latter malicious and base in petty ways; and acts of injustice are committed either through arrogance or through malice" (1295b4). A political community that has extremes of wealth and poverty "is a city not of free persons but of slaves and masters, the ones consumed by envy, the others by contempt. Nothing is further removed from affection and from a political partnership" (1295b22). People in the middle class are free from the arrogance that characterizes the rich and the envy that characterizes the poor. And, since members of this class are similar and equal in wealth, they are likely to regard one another as similar and equal generally, and to be willing to rule and be ruled in turn, neither demanding to rule at all times as the wealthy do or trying to avoid ruling as the poor do from their lack of resources. "Thus it is the greatest good fortune for those who are engaged in politics to have a middling and sufficient property, because where some possess very many things and others nothing, either [rule of] the people in its extreme form must come into being, or unmixed oligarchy, or - as a result of both of these excesses – tyranny. For tyranny arises from the most headstrong sort of democracy and from oligarchy, but much less often from the middling sorts [of regime] and those close to them" (1295b39).

There can be an enduring polity only when the middle class is able either to rule on its own or in conjunction with either of the other two groups, for in this way it can moderate their excesses: "Where the multitude of middling persons predominates either over both of the extremities together or over one alone, there a lasting polity is capable of existing" (1296b38). Unfortunately, Aristotle says, this state of affairs almost never exists. Instead, whichever group, rich or poor, is able to achieve power conducts affairs to suit itself rather than considering the interests of the other group: "whichever of the two succeeds in dominating its opponents does not establish a regime that is common or equal, but they grasp for preeminence in the regime as the prize of victory" (1296a29). And as a result, neither group seeks equality but instead each tries to dominate the other, believing that it is the only way to avoid being dominated in turn. This is a recipe for instability, conflict, and ultimately civil war, rather than a lasting regime. For the polity (or any other regime) to last, "the part of the city that wants the regime to continue must be superior to the part not wanting this" in quality and quantity (1296b16). He repeats this in Book V, calling it the "great principle": "keep watch to ensure that that the multitude wanting the regime is superior to that not wanting it" (1309b16), and in Book VI he discusses how this can be arranged procedurally (VI.3).

The remainder of Book IV focuses on the kinds of authority and offices in the city and how these can be distributed in democratic or oligarchic fashion. We do not need to concern ourselves with these details, but it does show that Aristotle is concerned with particular kinds of flawed regimes and how they can best operate and function in addition to his interest in the best practical government and the best government generally.

11. The Politics, Book V

a. Conflict between the Rich and the Poor

In Book V Aristotle turns his attention to how regimes can be preserved and how they are destroyed. Since we have seen what kind of regime a polity is, and how it can be made to endure, we are already in a position to see what is wrong with regimes which do not adopt the principles of a polity. We have already seen the claims of the few rich and the many poor to rule. The former believe that because they are greater in material wealth they should also be greater in political power, while the latter claim that because all citizens are equally free political power should also be equally distributed, which allows the many poor to rule because of their superior numbers. Both groups are partially correct, but neither is entirely correct, "And it is for this reason that, when either [group] does not share in the regime on the basis of the conception it happens to have, they engage in factional conflict" which can lead to civil war (1301a37). While the virtuous also have a claim to rule, the very fact that they are virtuous leads them to avoid factional conflict. They are also too small a group to be politically consequential: "[T]hose who are outstanding in virtue do not engage in factional conflict to speak of; for they are few against many" (1304b4). Therefore, the conflict that matters is the one between the rich and poor, and as we have seen, whichever group gets the upper hand will arrange things for its own benefit and in order to harm the other group. The fact that each of these groups ignores the common good and seeks only its own interest is why both oligarchy and democracy are flawed regimes. It is also ultimately self-destructive to try to put either kind of regime into practice: "Yet to have everywhere an arrangement that is based simply on one or the other of these sorts of equality is a poor thing. This is evident from the result: none of these sorts of regimes is lasting" (1302a3). On the other hand, "[O]ne should not consider as characteristic of popular rule or of oligarchy something tha t will make the city democratically or oligarchically run to the greatest extent possible, but something that will do so for the longest period of time" (1320a1). Democracy tends to be more stable than oligarchy, because democracies only have a conflict between rich and poor, while oligarchies also have conflicts within the ruling group of oligarchs to hold power. In addition, democracy is closer to polity than oligarchy is, and this contributes to its greater stability. And this is an important goal; the more moderate a regime is, the longer it is likely to remain in place.

Why does factional conflict arise? Aristotle turns to this question in Chapter 2. He says: "The lesser engage in factional conflict in order to be equal; those who are equal, in order to be greater" (1302a29). What are the things in which the lesser seek to be equal and the equal to be greater? "As for the things over which they engage in factional conflict, these are profit and honor and their opposites….They are stirred up further by arrogance, by fear, by preeminence, by contempt, by disproportionate growth, by electioneering, by underestimation, by [neglect of] small things, and by dissimilarity" (1302a33). Aristotle describes each of these in more detail. We will not examine them closely, but it is worth observing that Aristotle regards campaigning for office as a potentially dangerous source of conflict. If the city is arranged in such a way that either of the major factions feels that it is being wronged by the other, there are many things that can trigger conflict and even civil war; the regime is inherently unstable. We see again the importance of maintaining a regime which all of the groups in the city wish to see continue.

Aristotle says of democracies that "[D]emocracies undergo revolution particularly on account of the wanton behavior of the popular leaders" (1304b20). Such leaders will harass the property owners, causing them to unify against the democracy, and they will also stir up the poor against the rich in order to maintain themselves in power. This leads to conflict between the two groups and civil war. Aristotle cites a number of historical examples of this. Oligarchies undergo revolution primarily "when they treat the multitude unjustly. Any leader is then adequate [to effect revolution]" (1305a29). Revolution in oligarchical regimes can also come about from competition within the oligarchy, when not all of the oligarchs have a share in the offices. In this case those without power will engage in revolution not to change the regime but to change those who are ruling.

b. How to Preserve Regimes

However, despite all the dangers to the regimes, and the unavoidable risk that any particular regime will be overthrown, Aristotle does have advice regarding the preservation of regimes. In part, of course, we learn how to preserve the regimes by learning what causes revolutions and then avoiding those causes, so Aristotle has already given us useful advice for the preservation of regimes. But he has more advice to offer: "In well-blended regimes, then, one should watch out to ensure there are no transgressions of the laws, and above all be on guard against small ones" (1307b29). Note, again, the importance of letting the laws rule.

It is also important in every regime "to have the laws and management of the rest arranged in such a way that it is impossible to profit from the offices….The many do not chafe as much at being kept away from ruling - they are even glad if someone leaves them the leisure for their private affairs – as they do when they suppose that their rulers are stealing common [funds]; then it pains them both not to share in the prerogatives and not to share in the profits" (1308b32).

And, again, it is beneficial if the group that does not have political power is allowed to share in it to the greatest extent possible, though it should not be allowed to hold the authoritative offices (such as general, treasurer, and so forth). Such men must be chosen extremely carefully: "Those who are going to rule in the authoritative offices ought to have three things: first, affection for the established regime; next, a very great capacity for the work involved in rule; third, virtue and justice - in each regime the sort that is relative to the regime…" (1309a33). It is difficult to find all three of these in many men, but it is important for the regime to make use of the men with these qualities to the greatest degree possible, or else the regime will be harmed, either by sedition, incompetence, or corruption. Aristotle also reminds us of the importance of the middling element for maintaining the regime and making it long-lasting; instead of hostility between the oligarchs and democrats, whichever group has power should be certain always to behave benevolently and justly to the other group (1309b18).

"But the greatest of all the things that have been mentioned with a view to making regimes lasting - though it is now slighted by all – is education relative to the regimes. For there is no benefit in the most beneficial laws, even when these have been approved by all those engaging in politics, if they are not going to be habituated and educated in the regime – if the laws are popular, in a popular spirit, if oligarchic, in an oligarchic spirit" (1310a13). This does not mean that the people living in a democracy should be educated to believe that oligarchs are enemies of the regime, to be oppressed as much as possible and treated unjustly, nor does it mean that the wealthy under an oligarchy should be educated to believe that the poor are to be treated with arrogance and contempt. Instead it means being educated in the principles of moderate democracy and moderate oligarchy, so that the regime will be long-lasting and avoid revolution.

In the remainder of Book V Aristotle discusses monarchy and tyranny and what preserves and destroys these types of regimes. Here Aristotle is not discussing the kind of monarchies with which most people today are familiar, involving hereditary descent of royal power, usually from father to son. A monarch in Aristotle's sense is one who rules because he is superior to all other citizens in virtue. Monarchy therefore involves individual rule on the basis of merit for the good of the whole city, and the monarch because of his virtue is uniquely well qualified to determine what that means. The tyrant, on the other hand, rules solely for his own benefit and pleasure. Monarchy, therefore, involving the rule of the best man over all, is the best kind of regime, while tyranny, which is essentially the rule of a master over a regime in which all are slaves, is the worst kind of regime, and in fact is really no kind of regime at all. Aristotle lists the particular ways in which both monarchy and tyranny are changed and preserved. We do not need to spend much time on these, for Aristotle says that in his time "there are many persons who are similar, with none of them so outstanding as to match the extent and the claim to merit of the office" that would be required for the rule of one man on the basis of exceptional virtue that characterizes monarchy (1313a5), and tyranny is inherently extremely short lived and clearly without value. However, those wishing to preserve either of these kinds of regimes are advised, as oligarchs and democrats have been, to pursue moderation, diminishing the degree of their power in order to extend its duration.

12. The Politics, Book VI

a. Varieties of Democracy

Most of Book VI is concerned with the varieties of democracy, although Aristotle also revisits the varieties of oligarchy. Some of this discussion has to do with the various ways in which the offices, laws, and duties can be arranged. This part of the discussion we will pass over. However, Aristotle also includes a discussion of the animating principle of democracy, which is freedom: "It is customarily said that only in this sort of regime do [men] share in freedom, for, so it is asserted, every democracy aims at this" (1317a40). In modern liberal democracies, of course, the ability of all to share in freedom and for each citizen to live as one wants is considered one of the regime's strengths. However, keep in mind that Aristotle believes that human life has a telos and that the political community should provide education and laws that will lead to people pursuing and achieving this telos. Given that this is the case, a regime that allows people to do whatever they want is in fact flawed, for it is not guiding them in the direction of the good life.

b. The Best Kind of Democracy

He also explains which of the varieties of democracy is the best. In Chapter 4, we discover that the best sort of democracy is the one made up of farmers: "The best people is the farming sort, so that it is possible also to create [the best] democracy wherever the multitude lives from farming or herding. For on account of not having much property it is lacking in leisure, and so is unable to hold frequent assemblies. Because they do not have the necessary things, they spend their time at work and do not desire the things of others; indeed, working is more pleasant to them than engaging in politics and ruling, where there are not great spoils to be gotten from office" (1318b9). This is a reason why the authoritative offices can be in the hands of the wealthy, as long as the people retain control of auditing and adjudication: "Those who govern themselves in this way must necessarily be finely governed. The offices will always be in the hands of the best persons, the people being willing and not envious of the respectable, while the arrangement is satisfactory for the respectable and notable. These will not be ruled by others who are their inferiors, and they will rule justly by the fact that others have authority over the audits" (1318b33). By "adjudication" Aristotle means that the many should be certain that juries should be made up of men from their ranks, so that the laws will be enforced with a democratic spirit and the rich will not be able to use their wealth to put themselves above the law. By "authority over the audits" Aristotle refers to an institution which provided that those who held office had to provide an accounting of their activities at regular intervals: where the city's funds came from, where they went, what actions they took, and so forth. They were liable to prosecution if they were found to have engaged in wrongdoing or mismanagement, and the fear of this prosecution, Aristotle says, will keep them honest and ensure that they act according to the wishes of the democracy.

So we see again that the institutions and laws of a city are important, but equally important is the moral character of the citizens. It is only the character of the farming population that makes the arrangements Aristotle describes possible: "The other sorts of multitude out of which the remaining sorts of democracy are constituted are almost all much meaner than these: their way of life is a mean one, with no task involving virtue among the things that occupy the multitude of human beings who are vulgar persons and merchants or the multitude of laborers" (1319a24). And while Aristotle does not say it here, of course a regime organized in this way, giving a share of power to the wealthy and to the poor, under the rule of law, in the interest of everyone, would in fact be a polity more than it would be a democracy.

c. The Role of Wealth in a Democracy

In Chapter 5 of Book VI he offers further advice that would move the city in the direction of polity when he discusses how wealth should be handled in a democracy. Many democracies offer pay for serving in the assembly or on juries so that the poor will be able to attend. Aristotle advises minimizing the number of trials and length of service on juries so that the cost will not be too much of a burden on the wealthy where there are not sources of revenue from outside the city (Athens, for example, received revenue from nearby silver mines, worked by slaves). Where such revenues exist, he criticizes the existing practice of distributing surpluses to the poor in the form of cash payments, which the poor citizens will take while demanding more. However, poverty is a genuine problem in a democracy: "[O]ne who is genuinely of the popular sort (i.e. a supporter of democracy) should see to it that the multitude is not overly poor, for this is the reason for democracy being depraved" (1320a33). Instead the surplus should be allowed to accumulate until enough is available to give the poor enough money to acquire land or start a trade. And even if there is no external surplus, "[N]otables who are refined and sensible will divide the poor among themselves and provide them with a start in pursuing some work" (1320b8). It seems somewhat unusual for Aristotle to be advocating a form of welfare, but that is what he is doing, on the grounds that poverty is harmful to the character of the poor and this harms the community as a whole by undermining its stability.

13. The Politics, Book VII

a. The Best Regime and the Best Men

It is in Book VII that Aristotle describes the regime that is best without qualification. This differs from the discussion of the best regime in Book IV because in Book IV Aristotle's concern was the best practical regime, meaning one that it would be possible to bring about from the material provided by existing regimes. Here, however, his interest is in the best regime given the opportunity to create everything just as we would want it. It is "the city that is to be constituted on the basis of what one would pray for" (1325b35). As would be expected, he explicitly ties it to the question of the best way of life: "Concerning the best regime, one who is going to undertake the investigation appropriate to it must necessarily discuss first what the most choiceworthy way of life is. As long as this is unclear, the best regime must necessarily be unclear as well…" (1323a14). We have already discussed the best way of life, as well as the fact that most people do not pursue it: "For [men] consider any amount of virtue to be adequate, but wealth, goods, power, reputation, and all such things they seek to excess without limit" (1323a35). This is, as we have said more than once, a mistake: "Living happily…is available to those who have to excess the adornments of character and mind but behave moderately in respect to the external acquisition of good things" (1323b1). And what is true for the individual is also true for the city. Therefore "the best city is happy and acts nobly. It is impossible to act nobly without acting [to achieve] noble things; but there is no noble deed either of a man or of a city that is separate from virtue and prudence. The courage, justice, and prudence of a city have the same power and form as those human beings share in individually who are called just, prudent, and sound." (1324b30). The best city, like any other city, must educate its citizens to support its principles. The difference between this city and other cities is that the principles that it teaches its citizens are the correct principles for living the good life. It is here, and nowhere else, that the excellent man and the good citizen are the same.

b. Characteristics of the Best City

What would be the characteristics of the best city we could imagine? First of all, we want the city to be the right size. Many people, Aristotle says, are confused about what this means. They assume that the bigger the city is, the better it will be. But this is wrong. It is certainly true that the city must be large enough to defend itself and to be self-sufficient, but "This too, at any rate, is evident from the facts: that it is difficult - perhaps impossible – for a city that is too populous to be well managed" (1326a26). So the right size for the city is a moderate one; it is the one that enables it to perform its function of creating virtuous citizens properly. "[T]he [city] that is made up of too few persons is not self-sufficient, though the city is a self-sufficient thing, while the one that is made up of too many persons is with respect to the necessary things self-sufficient like a nation, but is not a city; for it is not easy for a regime to be present" (1326b3). There is an additional problem in a regime that is too large: "With a view to judgment concerning the just things and with a view to distributing offices on the basis of merit, the citizens must necessarily be familiar with one another's qualities; where this does not happen to be the case, what is connected with the offices and with judging must necessarily be carried on poorly" (1326b13).

The size of the territory is also an important element of the ideal regime, and it too must be tailored to the purpose of the regime. Aristotle says "[the territory should be] large enough so that the inhabitants are able to live at leisure in liberal fashion and at the same time with moderation" (1326b29). Again Aristotle's main concern is with life at peace, not life at war. On the other hand, the city and its territory should be such as to afford its inhabitants advantages in times of war; "it ought to be difficult for enemies to enter, but readily exited by [the citizens] themselves," and not so big that it cannot be "readily surveyable" because only such a territory is "readily defended" (1326b41). It should be laid out in such a way as to be readily defensible (Book VII, Chapters 11-12). It should also be defensible by sea, since proper sea access is part of a good city. Ideally the city will (like Athens) have a port that is several miles away from the city itself, so that contact with foreigners can be regulated. It should also be in the right geographical location.

Aristotle believed that geography was an important factor in determining the characteristics of the people living in a certain area. He thought that the Greeks had the good traits of both the Europeans (spiritedness) and Asians (souls endowed with art and thought) because of the Greek climate (1327b23). While the harsh climate to the north made Europeans hardy and resilient, as well as resistant to being ruled (although Aristotle did not know about the Vikings, they are perhaps the best example of what he is talking about), and the climate of what he called Asia and we now call the Middle East produced a surplus of food that allowed the men the leisure to engage in intellectual and artistic endeavors while robbing them of spiritedness, the Greeks had the best of both worlds: "[I]t is both spirited and endowed with thought, and hence both remains free and governs itself in the best manner and at the same time is capable of ruling all…" (1327b29).

However, despite the necessary attention to military issues, when we consider the ideal city, the principles which we have already elaborated about the nature of the citizens remain central. Even in the ideal city, constructed to meet the conditions for which we would pray, the need for certain tasks, such as farming and laboring, will remain. Therefore there will also be the need for people to do these tasks. But such people should not be citizens, for (as we have discussed) they will lack the leisure and the intellect to participate in governing the city. They are not really even part of the city: "Hence while cities need possessions, possessions are no part of the city. Many animate things (i.e. slaves and laborers) are part of possessions. But the city is a partnership of similar persons, for the sake of a life that is the best possible" (1328a33). The citizens cannot be merchants, laborers, or farmers, "for there is a need for leisure both with a view to the creation of virtue and with a view to political activities" (1329a1). So all the people living in the city who are not citizens are there for the benefit of the citizens. Any goals, wishes, or desires that they might have are irrelevant; in Kant's terms, they are treated as means rather than ends.

Those that live the lives of leisure that are open to citizens because of the labor performed by the non-citizens (again, including the women) are all similar to one another, and therefore the appropriate political arrangement for them is "in similar fashion to participate in ruling and being ruled in turn. For equality is the same thing [as justice] for persons who are similar, and it is difficult for a regime to last if its constitution is contrary to justice" (1332b25). These citizens will only be able to rule and be ruled in turn if they have had the proper upbringing, and this is the last major topic that Aristotle takes up in the Politics. Most cities make the mistake of neglecting education altogether, leaving it up to fathers to decide whether they will educate their sons at all, and if so what subject matter will be covered and how it will be taught. Some cities have in fact paid attention to the importance of the proper education of the young, training them in the virtues of the regime. Unfortunately, these regimes have taught them the wrong things. Aristotle is particularly concerned with Sparta here; the Spartans devoted great effort to bringing up their sons to believe that the virtues related to war were the only ones that mattered in life. They were successful; but because war is not the ultimate good, their education was not good. (Recall that the Spartan education was also flawed because it neglected the women entirely).

It is important for the person devising the ideal city to learn from this mistake. Such cities do not last unless they constantly remain at war (which is not an end in itself; no one pursues war for its own sake). Aristotle says "Most cities of this sort preserve themselves when at war, but once having acquired [imperial] rule they come to ruin; they lose their edge, like iron, when they remain at peace. The reason is that the legislator has not educated them to be capable of being at leisure" (1334a6). The proper education must be instilled from the earliest stages of life, and even before; Aristotle tells us the ages that are appropriate for marriage (37 for men, 18 for women) in order to bring about children of the finest quality, and insists on the importance of a healthful regimen for pregnant women, specifying that they take sufficient food and remain physically active. He also says that abortion is the appropriate solution when the population threatens to grow too large (1335b24).

14. The Politics, Book VIII

a. The Education of the Young

Book VIII is primarily concerned with the kind of education that the children of the citizens should receive. That this is a crucial topic for Aristotle is clear from its first sentence: "That the legislator must, therefore, make the education of the young his object above all would be disputed by no one" (1337a10). It is so important that it cannot be left to individual families, as was the custom in Greece. Instead, "Since there is a single end for the city as a whole, it is evident that education must necessarily be one and the same for all, and that the superintendence of it should be common and not on a private basis….For common things the training too should be made common" (1337a21). The importance of a common education shaping each citizen so as to enable him to serve the common good of the city recalls the discussion of how the city is prior to the individual in Book I Chapter 2; as has been quoted already in the discussion above, "one ought not even consider that a citizen belongs to himself, but rather that all belong to the city; for each individual is a part of the city" (1337a26).

He elaborates on the content of this education, noting that it should involve the body as well as the mind. Aristotle includes physical education, reading and writing, drawing, and music as subjects which the young potential citizens must learn. The aim of this education is not productive or theoretical knowledge. Instead it is meant to teach the young potential citizens practical knowledge - the kind of knowledge that each of them will need to fulfill his telos and perform his duties as a citizen. Learning the subjects that fall under the heading of productive knowledge, such as how to make shoes, would be degrading to the citizen. Learning the subjects that would fall under the heading of theoretical knowledge would be beyond the ability of most of the citizens, and is not necessary to them as citizens.

15. References and Further Reading

The list below is not intended to be comprehensive. It is limited to works published from 1962 to 2002. Most of these have their own bibliographies and suggested reading lists, and the reader is encouraged to take advantage of these.

Translations of Aristotle

  • Barnes, Jonathan, ed. The Complete Works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984. Two volumes.
    • The standard edition of Aristotle's complete works.
  • Irwin, Terence, and Gail Fine, eds. Aristotle: Introductory Readings. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, Inc., 1996
    • As the title suggests, this book includes excerpts from Aristotle's writings. Understanding any of Aristotle's texts means reading it in its entirety, but if you want a book by your side to check cross-references from whichever of his texts you are reading (for example, if the editor of the edition of the Politics you are reading refers to the Ethics), this one should do the trick.
  • Aristotle. Nicomachean Ethics. Translated and edited by Roger Crisp. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
    • This translation lacks the scholarly and critical apparatus of the Rowe translation but is still a fine choice.
  • Aristotle. Nicomachean Ethics. Translated and edited by Terry Irwin. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 1999.
  • Aristotle. Nicomachean Ethics. Translated and with an introduction by Martin Ostwald. New York: Macmillan Publishing Company, 1962.
    • The translation used in preparing this entry. A good basic translation.
  • Aristotle. Nicomachean Ethics. Translated and with an introduction by David Ross. Revised by J.L. Ackrill and J.O. Urmson. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1980.
    • Updated and revised version of a classic translation from 1925. See also Ross' book on Aristotle below.
  • Aristotle. Nicomachean Ethics. Translation and historical introduction by Christopher Rowe; philosophical introduction and commentary by Sarah Broadie. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002.
    • A very thorough introduction and commentary are included with this translation of theEthics. A good choice for the beginning student - but remember that the introduction and commentary are not meant to substitute for actually reading the text!
  • Aristotle. The Politics. Translated and with an introduction by Carnes Lord. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1984.
    • The translation used in preparing this entry. A useful introduction and very thorough notes, identifying names, places, and terms with which the reader may not be familiar.
  • Aristotle. The Politics. Translated by C.D.C. Reeve. Indianapolis : Hackett Publishing, 1998.
  • Aristotle. The Politics of Aristotle. Translated by Peter Simpson. Chapel Hill: University of North Carolina Press, 1997.
  • Aristotle. The Politics and The Constitution of Athens. Edited by Stephen Everson. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
    • If you're looking for The Constitution of Athens this is a good place to go - and with thePolitics in the same book it's easy to compare the two books to each other. However, the texts are lacking in footnotes, which is a particular problem with the Constitution since it records Athenian history. So, for example, on page 237 we learn that during the rule of the Thirty Tyrants in Athens the rulers chose "ten colleagues to govern the Peiraeus," without any indication that the Peiraeus was the Athenian harbor and its surrounding community, five miles from the city (it is also the setting of Plato's Republic). It would help to have names, places, and concepts defined and explained through footnotes for the beginning student. The more advanced student may wish to consult the four volumes on the Politics in the Oxford University Press's Clarendon Aristotle Series. Volume I, covering Books I and II of the Politics, is by Trevor Saunders; Volume II, on Books III and IV, is by Richard Robinson; Volume III, on Books V and VI, is by David Keyt, and Volume IV, on Books VII and VIII, is by Richard Kraut.
  • Aristotle. The Rhetoric. In George A. Kennedy, Aristotle On Rhetoric: A Theory of Civic Discourse.Translated and with an introduction by George A. Kennedy. New York: Oxford University Press, 1991.
    • The Rhetoric includes observations on politics and ethics in the context of teaching the reader how to become a rhetorician. Whether or not this requires the student to behave ethically is a matter of some debate. Speaking well in public settings was crucial to attaining political success in the Athenian democracy (and is still valuable today) and much of Aristotle's practical advice remains useful.

Secondary literature - general works on Aristotle

  • Ackrill, J. L. Aristotle the Philosopher. New York: Oxford University Press, 1981.
  • Adler, Mortimer. Aristotle for Everybody: Difficult Thought Made Easy. New York: Macmillan Publishing Co., Inc., 1978.
    • This is probably the easiest-to-read exposition of Aristotle available; Adler says that it is aimed at "everybody - of any age, from twelve or fourteen years upward." Obviously the author has had to make some sacrifices in the areas of detail and complexity to accomplish this, and anyone who has spent any time at all with Aristotle will probably wish to start elsewhere. Nevertheless, the author succeeds to a very great degree in delivering on the promise of the subtitle, expressing the basics of Aristotle's thought in simple language using common examples and straightforward descriptions.
  • Barnes, Jonathan. Aristotle: A Very Short Introduction. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Barnes, Jonathan, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Aristotle. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • "The Companion is intended for philosophical readers who are new to Aristotle," Barnes writes in the Introduction, and the book delivers. Chapter Seven, by D.S. Hutchinson, covers Aristotle's ethical theory; Chapter Eight, by C.C.W. Taylor, his political theory. Barnes himself writes the first chapter on Aristotle's life and work, as well as an excellent introduction which includes an explanation of why no book (or, I would add, encyclopedia article) can substitute for reading the original Aristotelian texts. It also includes the following: "Plato had an influence second only to Aristotle.... But Plato's philosophical views are mostly false, and for the most part they are evidently false; his arguments are mostly bad, and for the most part they are evidently bad." If those remarks provoke any kind of emotional or intellectual response in you, you may as well give up: you are on the way to being a student of philosophy.
  • Guthrie, W.K.C. Aristotle: An Encounter. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981.
    • Volume 6 of his six volume Cambridge History of Ancient Greek Philosophy written between 1962 and 1981.
  • Robinson, Timothy A. Aristotle in Outline. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, Inc., 1995.
    • Another short (125 pages) introduction to Aristotle's thought, with three sections: Wisdom and Science, Aristotle's Ethics, and Politics. It would be an excellent choice for the beginning student or anyone who just wants to be introduced to Aristotle's philosophy. Robinson is sympathetic to Aristotle but also to his readers, keeping things easy to read while at the same time offering enough detail about Aristotle's doctrines to illuminate his entire system and making the interconnections among the various elements of Aristotle's system clear.
  • Ross, Sir David. Aristotle. With an introduction by John L. Ackrill. Sixth edition. London: Routledge, 1995.
    • This is a classic in the field, now in its sixth edition, having first been published in 1923. Not many books can stay useful for eighty years. "It is not an elementary introduction for the absolute beginner," the introduction says, and that seems right to me, but neither does it require the reader to be an expert. It covers all of Aristotle's work, with chapters on Logic, Philosophy of Nature, Biology, Psychology, Metaphysics, Ethics, Politics, and Rhetoric and Poetics.
  • Thompson, Garrett and Marshall Missner. On Aristotle. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 2000.
    • Another short (100 page) overview of Aristotle's thought that is too short to be adequate for any one topic (Chapter Nine, Aristotle's view of politics, is less than six pages long) but might be useful for the new student of Aristotle interested in a brief look at the breadth of Aristotle's interests. The book by Barnes included above is to be preferred.

Secondary literature - books on Aristotle's Politics

  • Keyt, David, and Fred Miller, eds. A Companion to Aristotle's Politics. London: Blackwell, 1991.
  • Kraut, Richard. Aristotle: Political Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002.
    • An exceptional work of scholarship. Detailed, insightful, and as close to being comprehensive as anyone is likely to get in one book. The text is clearly broken down by topic and sub-topic, and the bibliography will help steer the Aristotle student in the right direction for future research. Kraut also notes other authors who disagree with his interpretation and why he believes they are wrong; this too is helpful for further research. Highly recommended.
  • Miller, Fred. Nature, Justice and Rights in Aristotle's Politics. New York: Oxford University Press, 1995.
  • Mulgan, R.G. Aristotle's Political Theory: An Introduction for Students of Political Theory. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1977.
    • Mulgan's book "is intended for students of political theory who are meeting the Politics for the first time and in an English translation." It is divided into subjects rather than following the topics in the order discussed in the Politics as this article has done, with footnotes to the relevant passages in Aristotle's texts. It is nicely detailed and offers excellent discussions (and criticisms) of Aristotle's thought.
  • Simpson, Peter. A Philosophical Commentary on the Politics of Aristotle. Chapel Hill: University of North Carolina Press, 1998.

Author Information:

Edward Clayton
Central Michigan University
U. S. A.

Aristotle: Poetics

aristotleThe Poetics of Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.) is a much-disdained book. So unpoetic a soul as Aristotle's has no business speaking about such a topic, much less telling poets how to go about their business. He reduces the drama to its language, people say, and the language itself to its least poetic element, the story, and then he encourages insensitive readers like himself to subject stories to crudely moralistic readings, that reduce tragedies to the childish proportions of Aesop-fables. Strangely, though, the Poetics itself is rarely read with the kind of sensitivity its critics claim to possess, and the thing criticized is not the book Aristotle wrote but a caricature of it. Aristotle himself respected Homer so much that he personally corrected a copy of the Iliad for his student Alexander, who carried it all over the world. In his Rhetoric (III, xvi, 9), Aristotle criticizes orators who write exclusively from the intellect, rather than from the heart, in the way Sophocles makes Antigone speak. Aristotle is often thought of as a logician, but he regularly uses the adverb logikôs, logically, as a term of reproach contrasted with phusikôs, naturally or appropriately, to describe arguments made by others, or preliminary and inadequate arguments of his own. Those who take the trouble to look at the Poetics closely will find, I think, a book that treats its topic appropriately and naturally, and contains the reflections of a good reader and characteristically powerful thinker.

Table of Contents

  1. Poetry as Imitation
  2. The Character of Tragedy
  3. Tragic Catharsis
  4. Tragic Pity
  5. Tragic Fear and the Image of Humanity
  6. The Iliad, the Tempest, and Tragic Wonder
  7. Excerpts from Aristotle's Poetics
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Poetry as Imitation

The first scandal in the Poetics is the initial marking out of dramatic poetry as a form of imitation. We call the poet a creator, and are offended at the suggestion that he might be merely some sort of recording device. As the painter's eye teaches us how to look and shows us what we never saw, the dramatist presents things that never existed until he imagined them, and makes us experience worlds we could never have found the way to on our own. But Aristotle has no intention to diminish the poet, and in fact says the same thing I just said, in making the point that poetry is more philosophic than history. By imitation, Aristotle does not mean the sort of mimicry by which Aristophanes, say, finds syllables that approximate the sound of frogs. He is speaking of the imitation of action, and by action he does not mean mere happenings. Aristotle speaks extensively of praxis in the Nicomachean Ethics. It is not a word he uses loosely, and in fact his use of it in the definition of tragedy recalls the discussion in the Ethics.

Action, as Aristotle uses the word, refers only to what is deliberately chosen, and capable of finding completion in the achievement of some purpose. Animals and young children do not act in this sense, and action is not the whole of the life of any of us. The poet must have an eye for the emergence of action in human life, and a sense for the actions that are worth paying attention to. They are not present in the world in such a way that a video camera could detect them. An intelligent, feeling, shaping human soul must find them. By the same token, the action of the drama itself is not on the stage. It takes form and has its being in the imagination of the spectator. The actors speak and move and gesture, but it is the poet who speaks through them, from imagination to imagination, to present to us the thing that he has made. Because that thing he makes has the form of an action, it has to be seen and held together just as actively and attentively by us as by him. The imitation is the thing that is re-produced, in us and for us, by his art. This is a powerful kind of human communication, and the thing imitated is what defines the human realm. If no one had the power to imitate action, life might just wash over us without leaving any trace.

How do I know that Aristotle intends the imitation of action to be understood in this way? In De Anima, he distinguishes three kinds of perception (II, 6; III, 3). There is the perception of proper sensibles-colors, sounds, tastes and so on; these lie on the surfaces of things and can be mimicked directly for sense perception. But there is also perception of common sensibles, available to more than one of our senses, as shape is grasped by both sight and touch, or number by all five senses; these are distinguished by imagination, the power in us that is shared by the five senses, and in which the circular shape, for instance, is not dependent on sight or touch alone. These common sensibles can be mimicked in various ways, as when I draw a messy, meandering ridge of chalk on a blackboard, and your imagination grasps a circle. Finally, there is the perception of that of which the sensible qualities are attributes, the thing--the son of Diares, for example; it is this that we ordinarily mean by perception, and while its object always has an image in the imagination, it can only be distinguished by intellect, no°s (III,4). Skilled mimics can imitate people we know, by voice, gesture, and so on, and here already we must engage intelligence and imagination together. The dramatist imitates things more remote from the eye and ear than familiar people. Sophocles and Shakespeare, for example, imitate repentance and forgiveness, true instances of action in Aristotle's sense of the word, and we need all the human powers to recognize what these poets put before us. So the mere phrase imitation of an action is packed with meaning, available to us as soon as we ask what an action is, and how the image of such a thing might be perceived.

Aristotle does understand tragedy as a development out of the child's mimicry of animal noises, but that is in the same way that he understands philosophy as a development out of our enjoyment of sight-seeing (Metaphysics I, 1). In each of these developments there is a vast array of possible intermediate stages, but just as philosophy is the ultimate form of the innate desire to know, tragedy is considered by Aristotle the ultimate form of our innate delight in imitation. His beloved Homer saw and achieved the most important possibilities of the imitation of human action, but it was the tragedians who, refined and intensified the form of that imitation, and discovered its perfection.

2. The Character of Tragedy

A work is a tragedy, Aristotle tells us, only if it arouses pity and fear. Why does he single out these two passions? Some interpreters think he means them only as examples--pity and fear and other passions like that--but I am not among those loose constructionists. Aristotle does use a word that means passions of that sort (toiouta), but I think he does so only to indicate that pity and fear are not themselves things subject to identification with pin-point precision, but that each refers to a range of feeling. It is just the feelings in those two ranges, however, that belong to tragedy. Why? Why shouldn't some tragedy arouse pity and joy, say, and another fear and cruelty? In various places, Aristotle says that it is the mark of an educated person to know what needs explanation and what doesn't. He does not try to prove that there is such a thing as nature, or such a thing as motion, though some people deny both. Likewise, he understands the recognition of a special and powerful form of drama built around pity and fear as the beginning of an inquiry, and spends not one word justifying that restriction. We, however, can see better why he starts there by trying out a few simple alternatives.

Suppose a drama aroused pity in a powerful way, but aroused no fear at all. This is an easily recognizable dramatic form, called a tear-jerker. The name is meant to disparage this sort of drama, but why? Imagine a well written, well made play or movie that depicts the losing struggle of a likable central character. We are moved to have a good cry, and are afforded either the relief of a happy ending, or the realistic desolation of a sad one. In the one case the tension built up along the way is released within the experience of the work itself; in the other it passes off as we leave the theater, and readjust our feelings to the fact that it was, after all, only make-believe. What is wrong with that? There is always pleasure in strong emotion, and the theater is a harmless place to indulge it. We may even come out feeling good about being so compassionate. But Dostoyevski depicts a character who loves to cry in the theater, not noticing that while she wallows in her warm feelings her coach-driver is shivering outside. She has day-dreams about relieving suffering humanity, but does nothing to put that vague desire to work. If she is typical, then the tear-jerker is a dishonest form of drama, not even a harmless diversion but an encouragement to lie to oneself.

Well then, let's consider the opposite experiment, in which a drama arouses fear in a powerful way, but arouses little or no pity. This is again a readily recognizable dramatic form, called the horror story, or in a recent fashion, the mad-slasher movie. The thrill of fear is the primary object of such amusements, and the story alternates between the build-up of apprehension and the shock of violence. Again, as with the tear-jerker, it doesn't much matter whether it ends happily or with uneasiness, or even with one last shock, so indeterminate is its form. And while the tearjerker gives us an illusion of compassionate delicacy, the unrestrained shock-drama obviously has the effect of coarsening feeling. Genuine human pity could not co-exist with the so-called graphic effects these films use to keep scaring us. The attraction of this kind of amusement is again the thrill of strong feeling, and again the price of indulging the desire for that thrill may be high.

Let us consider a milder form of the drama built on arousing fear. There are stories in which fearsome things are threatened or done by characters who are in the end defeated by means similar to, or in some way equivalent to, what they dealt out. The fear is relieved in vengeance, and we feel a satisfaction that we might be inclined to call justice. To work on the level of feeling, though, justice must be understood as the exact inverse of the crime--doing to the offender the sort of thing he did or meant to do to others. The imagination of evil then becomes the measure of good, or at least of the restoration of order. The satisfaction we feel in the vicarious infliction of pain or death is nothing but a thin veil over the very feelings we mean to be punishing. This is a successful dramatic formula, arousing in us destructive desires that are fun to feel, along with the self-righteous illusion that we are really superior to the character who displays them. The playwright who makes us feel that way will probably be popular, but he is a menace.

We have looked at three kinds of non-tragedy that arouse passions in a destructive way, and we could add others. There are potentially as many kinds as there are passions and combinations of passions. That suggests that the theater is just an arena for the manipulation of passions in ways that are pleasant in the short run and at least reckless to pursue repeatedly. At worst, the drama could be seen as dealing in a kind of addiction, which it both produces and holds the only remedy for. But we have not yet tried to talk about the combination of passions characteristic of tragedy.

When we turn from the sort of examples I have given, to the acknowledged examples of tragedy, we find ourselves in a different world. The tragedians I have in mind are five: Aeschylus, Sophocles, and Euripides; Shakespeare, who differs from them only in time; and Homer, who differs from them somewhat more, in the form in which he composed, but shares with them the things that matter most. I could add other authors, such as Dostoyevski, who wrote stories of the tragic kind in much looser literary forms, but I want to keep the focus on a small number of clear paradigms.

When we look at a tragedy we find the chorus in Antigone telling us what a strange thing a human being is, that passes beyond all boundaries (lines 332 ff.), or King Lear asking if man is no more than this, a poor, bare, forked animal (III, iv, 97ff.), or Macbeth protesting to his wife "I dare do all that may become a man; who dares do more is none" (I, vii, 47-8), or Oedipus taunting Teiresias with the fact that divine art was of no use against the Sphinx, but only Oedipus' own human ingenuity (Oed. Tyr. 39098), or Agamemnon, resisting walking home on tapestries, saying to his wife "I tell you to revere me as a man, not a god" (925), or Cadmus in the Bacchae saying "I am a man, nothing more" (199), while Dionysus tells Pentheus "You do not know what you are" (506), or Patroclus telling Achilles "Peleus was not your father nor Thetis your mother, but the gray sea bore you, and the towering rocks, so hard is your heart" (Iliad XVI, 335 ). I could add more examples of this kind by the dozen, and your memories will supply others. Tragedy seems always to involve testing or finding the limits of what is human. This is no mere orgy of strong feeling, but a highly focussed way of bringing our powers to bear on the image of what is human as such. I suggest that Aristotle is right in saying that the powers which first of all bring this human image to sight for us are pity and fear.

It is obvious that the authors in our examples are not just putting things in front of us to make us cry or shiver or gasp. The feelings they arouse are subordinated to another effect. Aristotle begins by saying that tragedy arouses pity and fear in such a way as to culminate in a cleansing of those passions, the famous catharsis. The word is used by Aristotle only the once, in his preliminary definition of tragedy. I think this is because its role is taken over later in the Poetics by another, more positive, word, but the idea of catharsis is important in itself, and we should consider what it might mean.

3. Tragic Catharsis

First of all, the tragic catharsis might be a purgation. Fear can obviously be an insidious thing that undermines life and poisons it with anxiety. It would be good to flush this feeling from our systems, bring it into the open, and clear the air. This may explain the appeal of horror movies, that they redirect our fears toward something external, grotesque, and finally ridiculous, in order to puncture them. On the other hand, fear might have a secret allure, so that what we need to purge is the desire for the thrill that comes with fear. The horror movie also provides a safe way to indulge and satisfy the longing to feel afraid, and go home afterward satisfied; the desire is purged, temporarily, by being fed. Our souls are so many-headed that opposite satisfactions may be felt at the same time, but I think these two really are opposite. In the first sense of purgation, the horror movie is a kind of medicine that does its work and leaves the soul healthier, while in the second sense it is a potentially addictive drug. Either explanation may account for the popularity of these movies among teenagers, since fear is so much a fact of that time of life. For those of us who are older, the tear-jerker may have more appeal, offering a way to purge the regrets of our lives in a sentimental outpouring of pity. As with fear, this purgation too may be either medicinal or drug-like.

This idea of purgation, in its various forms, is what we usually mean when we call something cathartic. People speak of watching football, or boxing, as a catharsis of violent urges, or call a shouting match with a friend a useful catharsis of buried resentment. This is a practical purpose that drama may also serve, but it has no particular connection with beauty or truth; to be good in this purgative way, a drama has no need to be good in any other way. No one would be tempted to confuse the feeling at the end of a horror movie with what Aristotle calls "the tragic pleasure," nor to call such a movie a tragedy. But the English word catharsis does not contain everything that is in the Greek word. Let us look at other things it might mean.

Catharsis in Greek can mean purification. While purging something means getting rid of it, purifying something means getting rid of the worse or baser parts of it. It is possible that tragedy purifies the feelings themselves of fear and pity. These arise in us in crude ways, attached to all sorts of objects. Perhaps the poet educates our sensibilities, our powers to feel and be moved, by refining them and attaching them to less easily discernible objects. There is a line in The Wasteland, "I will show you fear in a handful of dust." Alfred Hitchcock once made us all feel a little shudder when we took showers. The poetic imagination is limited only by its skill, and can turn any object into a focus for any feeling. Some people turn to poetry to find delicious and exquisite new ways to feel old feelings, and consider themselves to enter in that way into a purified state. It has been argued that this sort of thing is what tragedy and the tragic pleasure are all about, but it doesn't match up with my experience. Sophocles does make me fear and pity human knowledge when I watch the Oedipus Tyrannus, but this is not a refinement of those feelings but a discovery that they belong to a surprising object. Sophocles is not training my feelings, but using them to show me something worthy of wonder.

The word catharsis drops out of the Poetics because the word wonder, to rhaumaston, replaces it, first in chapter 9, where Aristotle argues that pity and fear arise most of all where wonder does, and finally in chapters 24 and 25, where he singles out wonder as the aim of the poetic art itself, into which the aim of tragedy in particular merges. Ask yourself how you feel at the end of a tragedy. You have witnessed horrible things and felt painful feelings, but the mark of tragedy is that it brings you out the other side. Aristotle's use of the word catharsis is not a technical reference to purgation or purification but a beautiful metaphor for the peculiar tragic pleasure, the feeling of being washed or cleansed.

The tragic pleasure is a paradox. As Aristotle says, in a tragedy, a happy ending doesn't make us happy. At the end of the play the stage is often littered with bodies, and we feel cleansed by it all. Are we like Clytemnestra, who says she rejoiced when spattered by her husband's blood, like the earth in a Spring rain (Ag. 1389-92)? Are we like Iago, who has to see a beautiful life destroyed to feel better about himself (Oth. V, i, 18-20)? We all feel a certain glee in the bringing low of the mighty, but this is in no way similar to the feeling of being washed in wonderment. The closest thing I know to the feeling at the end of a tragedy is the one that comes with the sudden, unexpected appearance of something beautiful. In a famous essay on beauty (Ennead I, tractate 6), Plotinus says two things that seem true to me: "Clearly [beauty] is something detected at a first glance, something that the soul... recognizes, gives welcome to, and, in a way, fuses with" (beginning sec. 2). What is the effect on us of this recognition? Plotinus says that in every instance it is "an astonishment, a delicious wonderment" (end sec. 4). Aristotle is insistent that a tragedy must be whole and one, because only in that way can it be beautiful, while he also ascribes the superiority of tragedy over epic poetry to its greater unity and concentration (ch. 26). Tragedy is not just a dramatic form in which some works are beautiful and others not; tragedy is itself a species of beauty. All tragedies are beautiful.

By following Aristotle's lead, we have now found five marks of tragedy: (1) it imitates an action, (2) it arouses pity and fear, (3) it displays the human image as such, (4) it ends in wonder, and (5) it is inherently beautiful. We noticed earlier that it is action that characterizes the distinctively human realm, and it is reasonable that the depiction of an action might show us a human being in some definitive way, but what do pity and fear have to do with that showing? The answer is everything.

4. Tragic Pity

First, let us consider what tragic pity consists in. The word pity tends to have a bad name these days, and to imply an attitude of condescension that diminishes its object. This is not a matter of the meanings of words, or even of changing attitudes. It belongs to pity itself to be two-sided, since any feeling of empathy can be given a perverse twist by the recognition that it is not oneself but another with whom one is feeling a shared pain. One of the most empathetic characters in all literature is Edgar in King Lear. He describes himself truly as "a most poor man, made tame to fortune's blows, Who, by the art of known and feeling sorrows, Am pregnant to good pity" (IV, vi, 217-19). Two of his lines spoken to his father are powerful evidence of the insight that comes from suffering oneself and taking on the suffering of others: "Thy life's a miracle" (IV, vi, 5 5 ), he says, and "Ripeness is all" (V, ii, 11), trying to help his father see that life is still good and death is not something to be sought. Yet in the last scene of the play this same Edgar voices the stupidest words ever spoken in any tragedy, when he concludes that his father just got what he deserved when he lost his eyes, since he had once committed adultery (V, iii, 171-4). Having witnessed the play, we know that Gloucester lost his eyes because he chose to help Lear, when the kingdom had become so corrupt that his act of kindness appeared as a walking fire in a dark world (I1I, iv, 107). There is a chain of effects from Gloucester's adultery to his mutilation, but it is not a sequence that reveals the true cause of that horror. The wholeness of action that Shakespeare shapes for us shows that Gloucester's goodness, displayed in a courageous, deliberate choice, and not his weakness many years earlier, cost him his eyes. Edgar ends by giving in to the temptation to moralize, to chase after the "fatal flaw" which is no part of tragedy, and loses his capacity to see straight.

This suggests that holding on to proper pity leads to seeing straight, and that seems exactly right. But what is proper pity? There is a way of missing the mark that is opposite to condescension, and that is the excess of pity called sentimentality. There are people who use the word sentimental for any display of feeling, or any taking seriously of feeling, but their attitude is as blind as Edgar's. Sentimentality is inordinate feeling, feeling that goes beyond the source that gives rise to it. The woman in Dostoyevski's novel who loves pitying for its own sake is an example of this vice. But between Edgar's moralizing and her gushing there is a range of appropriate pity. Pity is one of the instruments by which a poet can show us what we are. We pity the loss of Gloucester's eyes because we know the value of eyes, but more deeply, we pity the violation of Gloucester's decency, and in so doing we feel the truth that without such decency, and without respect for it, there is no human life. Shakespeare is in control here, and the feeling he produces does not give way in embarrassment to moral judgment, nor does it make us wallow mindlessly in pity because it feels so good; the pity he arouses in us shows us what is precious in us, in the act of its being violated in another.

5. Tragic Fear and the Image of Humanity

Since every boundary has two sides, the human image is delineated also from the outside, the side of the things that threaten it. This is shown to us through the feeling of fear. As Aristotle says twice in the Rhetoric, what we pity in others, we fear for ourselves (1382b 26, 1386a 27). In our mounting fear that Oedipus will come to know the truth about himself, we feel that something of our own is threatened. Tragic fear, exactly like tragic pity, and either preceding it or simultaneous with it, shows us what we are and are unwilling to lose. It makes no sense to say that Oedipus' passion for truth is a flaw, since that is the very quality that makes us afraid on his behalf. Tragedy is never about flaws, and it is only the silliest of mistranslations that puts that claim in Aristotle's mouth. Tragedy is about central and indispensable human attributes, disclosed to us by the pity that draws us toward them and the fear that makes us recoil from what threatens them.

Because the suffering of the tragic figure displays the boundaries of what is human, every tragedy carries the sense of universality. Oedipus or Antigone or Lear or Othello is somehow every one of us, only more so. But the mere mention of these names makes it obvious that they are not generalized characters, but altogether particular. And if we did not feel that they were genuine individuals, they would have no power to engage our emotions. It is by their particularity that they make their marks on us, as though we had encountered them in the flesh. It is only through the particularity of our feelings that our bonds with them emerge. What we care for and cherish makes us pity them and fear for them, and thereby the reverse also happens: our feelings of pity and fear make us recognize what we care for and cherish. When the tragic figure is destroyed it is a piece of ourselves that is lost. Yet we never feel desolation at the end of a tragedy, because what is lost is also, by the very same means, found. I am not trying to make a paradox, but to describe a marvel. It is not so strange that we learn the worth of something by losing it; what is astonishing is what the tragedians are able to achieve by making use of that common experience. They lift it up into a state of wonder.

Within our small group of exemplary poetic works, there are two that do not have the tragic form, and hence do not concentrate all their power into putting us in a state of wonder, but also depict the state of wonder among their characters and contain speeches that reflect on it. They are Homer's Iliad and Shakespeare's Tempest. (Incidentally, there is an excellent small book called Woe or Wonder, the Emotional Effect of Shakespearean Tragedy, by J. V. Cunningham, that demonstrates the continuity of the traditional understanding of tragedy from Aristotle to Shakespeare.) The first poem in our literary heritage, and Shakespeare's last play, both belong to a conversation of which Aristotle's Poetics is the most prominent part.

6. The Iliad, the Tempest, and Tragic Wonder

In both the Iliad and the Tempest there are characters with arts that in some ways resemble that of the poet. It is much noticed that Prospero's farewell to his art coincides with Shakespeare's own, but it may be less obvious that Homer has put into the Iliad a partial representation of himself. But the last 150 lines of Book XVIII of the Iliad describe the making of a work of art by Hephaestus. I will not consider here what is depicted on the shield of Achilles, but only the meaning in the poem of the shield itself. In Book XVIII, Achilles has realized what mattered most to him when it is too late. The Greeks are driven back to their ships, as Achilles had prayed they would be, and know that they are lost without him. "But what pleasure is this to me now," he says to his mother, "when my beloved friend is dead, Patroclus, whom I cherished beyond all friends, as the equal of my own soul; I am bereft of him" (80-82). Those last words also mean "I have killed him." In his desolation, Achilles has at last chosen to act. "I will accept my doom," he says (115 ). Thetis goes to Hephaestus because, in spite of his resolve, Achilles has no armor in which to meet his fate. She tells her son's story, concluding "he is lying on the ground, anguishing at heart" (461). Her last word, anguishing, acheuôn, is built on Achilles' name.

Now listen to what Hephaestus says in reply: "Take courage, and do not let these things distress you in your heart. Would that I had the power to hide him far away from death and the sounds of grief when grim fate comes to him, but I can see that beautiful armor surrounds him, of such a kind that many people, one after another, who look on it, will wonder" (463-67). Is it not evident that this source of wonder that surrounds Achilles, that takes the sting from his death even in a mother's heart, is the Iliad itself? But how does the Iliad accomplish this?

Let us shift our attention for a moment to the Tempest. The character Alonso, in the power of the magician Prospero, spends the length of the play in the illusion that his son has drowned. To have him alive again, Alonso says, "I wish Myself were mudded in that oozy bed Where my son lies" (V, i, 150-2). But he has already been there for three hours in his imagination; he says earlier "my son i' th' ooze is bedded; and I'll seek him deeper than e'er plummet sounded And with him there lie mudded" (III, iii, 100-2). What is this muddy ooze? It is Alonso's grief, and his regret for exposing his son to danger, and his self-reproach for his own past crime against Prospero and Prospero's baby daughter, which made his son a just target for divine retribution; the ooze is Alonso's repentance, which feels futile to him since it only comes after he has lost the thing he cares most about. But the spirit Ariel sings a song to Alonso's son: "Full fathom five thy father lies; Of his bones are coral made; Those are pearls that were his eyes; Nothing of him that doth fade But doth suffer a sea change Into something rich and strange" (I, ii, 397-402). Alonso's grief is aroused by an illusion, an imitation of an action, but his repentance is real, and is slowly transforming him into a different man. Who is this new man? Let us take counsel from the "honest old councilor" Gonzalo, who always has the clearest sight in the play. He tells us that on this voyage, when so much seemed lost, every traveller found himself "When no man was his own" (V, i, 206-13). The something rich and strange into which Alonso changes is himself, as he was before his life took a wrong turn. Prospero's magic does no more than arrest people in a potent illusion; in his power they are "knit up In their distractions" (III, iii, 89-90). When released, he says, "they shall be themselves" (V, i, 32).

On virtually every page of the Tempest, the word wonder appears, or else some synonym for it. Miranda's name is Latin for wonder, her favorite adjective brave seems to mean both good and out-of-the-ordinary, and the combination rich and strange means the same. What is wonder? J. V. Cunningham describes it in the book I mentioned as the shocked limit of all feeling, in which fear, sorrow, and joy can all merge. There is some truth in that, but it misses what is wonderful or wondrous about wonder. It suggests that in wonder our feelings are numbed and we are left limp, wrung dry of all emotion. But wonder is itself a feeling, the one to which Miranda is always giving voice, the powerful sense that what is before one is both strange and good. Wonder does not numb the other feelings; what it does is dislodge them from their habitual moorings. The experience of wonder is the disclosure of a sight or thought or image that fits no habitual context of feeling or understanding, but grabs and holds us by a power borrowed from nothing apart from itself. The two things that Plotinus says characterize beauty, that the soul recognizes it at first glance and spontaneously gives welcome to it, equally describe the experience of wonder. The beautiful always produces wonder, if it is seen as beautiful, and the sense of wonder always sees beauty.

But are there really no wonders that are ugly? The monstrosities that used to be exhibited in circus side-shows are wonders too, are they not? In the Tempest, three characters think first of all of such spectacles when they lay eyes on Caliban (II, ii, 28-31; V, i, 263-6), but they are incapable of wonder, since they think they know everything that matters already. A fourth character in the same batch, who is drunk but not insensible, gives way at the end of Act II to the sense that this is not just someone strange and deformed, nor just a useful servant, but a brave monster. But Stephano is not like the holiday fools who pay to see monstrosities like two-headed calves or exotic sights like wild men of Borneo. I recall an aquarium somewhere in Europe that had on display an astoundingly ugly catfish. People came casually up to its tank, were startled, made noises of disgust, and turned away. Even to be arrested before such a sight feels in some way perverse and has some conflict in the feeling it arouses, as when we stare at the victims of a car wreck. The sight of the ugly or disgusting, when it is felt as such, does not have the settled repose or willing surrender that are characteristic of wonder. "Wonder is sweet," as Aristotle says.

This sweet contemplation of something outside us is exactly opposite to Alonso's painful immersion in his own remorse, but in every other respect he is a model of the spectator of a tragedy. We are in the power of another for awhile, the sight of an illusion works real and durable changes in us, we merge into something rich and strange, and what we find by being absorbed in the image of another is ourselves. As Alonso is shown a mirror of his soul by Prospero, we are shown a mirror of ourselves in Alonso, but in that mirror we see ourselves as we are not in witnessing the Tempest, but in witnessing .a tragedy. The Tempest is a beautiful play, suffused with wonder as well as with reflections on wonder, but it holds the intensity of the tragic experience at a distance. Homer, on the other hand, has pulled off a feat even more astounding than Shakespeare's, by imitating the experience of a spectator of tragedy within a story that itself works on us as a tragedy.

In Book XXIV of the Iliad, forms of the word tham bos, amazement, occur three times in three lines (482-4), when Priam suddenly appears in the hut of Achilles and "kisses the terrible man-slaughtering hands that killed his many sons" (478-9), but this is only the prelude to the true wonder. Achilles and Priam cry together, each for his own grief, as each has cried so often before, but this time a miracle happens. Achilles' grief is transformed into satisfaction, and cleansed from his chest and his hands (513-14). This is all the more remarkable, since Achilles has for days been repeatedly trying to take out his raging grief on Hector's dead body. The famous first word of the Iliad, mÍnis, wrath, has come back at the beginning of Book XXIV in the participle meneainôn (22), a constant condition that Lattimore translates well as "standing fury." But all this hardened rage evaporates in one lamentation, just because Achilles shares it with his enemy's father. Hermes had told Priam to appeal to Achilles in the names of his father, his mother, and his child, "in order to stir his heart" (466-7), but Priam's focussed misery goes straight to Achilles' heart without diluting the effect. The first words out of Priam's mouth are "remember your father" (486). Your father deserves pity, Priam says, so "pity me with him in mind, since I am more pitiful even than he; I have dared what no other mortal on earth ever dared, to stretch out my lips to the hand of the man who murdered my children" (503-4).

Achilles had been pitying Patroclus, but mainly himself, but the feeling to which Priam has directed him now is exactly the same as tragic pity. Achilles is looking at a human being who has chosen to go to the limits of what is humanly possible to search for something that matters to him. The wonder of this sight takes Achilles out of his self-pity, but back into himself as a son and as a sharer of human misery itself. All his old longings for glory and revenge fall away, since they have no place in the sight in which he is now absorbed. For the moment, the beauty of Priam's terrible action re-makes the world, and determines what matters and what doesn't. The feeling in this moment out of time is fragile, and Achilles feels it threatened by tragic fear. In the strange fusion of this scene, what Achilles fears is himself; "don't irritate me any longer now, old man," he says when Priam tries to hurry along the return of Hector's body, "don't stir up my heart in its griefs any more now, lest I not spare even you yourself' (560, 568-9). Finally, after they share a meal, they just look at each other. "Priam wondered at Achilles, at how big he was and what he was like, for he seemed equal to the gods, but Achilles wondered at Trojan Priam, looking on the worthy sight of him and hearing his story" (629-32). In the grip of wonder they do not see enemies. They see truly. They see the beauty in two men who have lost almost everything. They see a son a father should be proud of and a father a son should revere.

The action of the Iliad stretches from Achilles' deliberate choice to remove himself from the war to his deliberate choice to return Hector's body to Priam. The passion of the Iliad moves from anger through pity and fear to wonder. Priam's wonder lifts him for a moment out of the misery he is enduring, and permits him to see the cause of that misery as still something good. Achilles' wonder is similar to that of Priam, since Achilles too sees the cause of his anguish in a new light, but in his case this takes several steps. When Priam first appears in his hut, Homer compares the amazement this produces to that with which people look at a murderer who has fled from his homeland (480-84). This is a strange comparison, and it recalls the even stranger fact disclosed one book earlier that Patroclus, whom everyone speaks of as gentle and kind-hearted (esp. XVII, 670-71), who gives his life because he cannot bear to see his friends destroyed to satisfy Achilles' anger, this same Patroclus began his life as a murderer in his own country, and came to Achilles' father Peleus for a second chance at life. When Achilles remembers his father, he is remembering the man whose kindness brought Patroclus into his life, so that his tears, now for his father, now again for Patroclus (XXIV, 511-12), merge into a single grief. But the old man crying with him is a father too, and Achilles' tears encompass Priam along with Achilles' own loved ones. Finally, since Priam is crying for Hector, Achilles' grief includes Hector himself, and so it turns his earlier anguish inside out. If Priam is like Achilles' father, then Hector must come to seem to Achilles to be like a brother, or to be like himself.

Achilles cannot be brought to such a reflection by reasoning, nor do the feelings in which he has been embroiled take him in that direction. Only Priam succeeds in unlocking Achilles' heart, and he does so by an action, by kissing his hand. From the beginning of Book XVIII (23, 27, 33), Achilles' hands are referred to over and over and over, as he uses them to pour dirt on his head, to tear his hair, and to kill every Trojan he can get his hands on. Hector, who must go up against those hands, is mesmerized by them; they are like a fire, he says, and repeats it. "His hands seem like a fire" (XX, 371-2). After Priam kisses Achilles' hand, and after they cry together, Homer tells us that the desire for lamentation went out of Achilles' chest and out of his hands (XXIV, 514). His murderous, manslaughtering hands are stilled by a grief that finally has no enemy to take itself out on. When, in Book XVIII, Achilles had accepted his doom (115), it was part of a bargain; "I will lie still when I am dead," he had said, "but now I must win splendid glory" (121). But at the end of the poem, Achilles has lost interest in glory. He is no longer eaten up by the desire to be lifted above Hector and Priam, but comes to rest in just looking at them for what they are. Homer does surround Achilles in armor that takes the sting from his misery and from his approaching death, by working that misery and death into the wholeness of the Iliad. But the Iliad is, as Aristotle says, the prototype of tragedy; it is not a poem that aims at conferring glory but a poem that bestows the gift of wonder.

Like Alonso in the Tempest, Achilles ultimately finds himself. Of the two, Achilles is the closer model of the spectator of a tragedy, because Alonso plunges deep into remorse before he is brought back into the shared world. Achilles is lifted directly out of himself, into the shared world, in the act of wonder, and sees his own image in the sorrowing father in front of him. This is exactly what a tragedy does to us, and exactly what we experience in looking at Achilles. In his loss, we pity him. In his fear of himself, on Priam's behalf, we fear for him, that he might lose his new-won humanity. In his capacity to be moved by the wonder of a suffering fellow human, we wonder at him. At the end of the Iliad, as at the end of every tragedy, we are washed in the beauty of the human image, which our pity and our fear have brought to sight. The five marks of tragedy that we learned of from Aristotle's Poetics--that it imitates an action, arouses pity and fear, displays the human image as such, ends in wonder, and is inherently beautiful--give a true and powerful account of the tragic pleasure.

7. Excerpts from Aristotle's Poetics

Ch. 6 A tragedy is an imitation of an action that is serious and has a wholeness in its extent, in language that is pleasing (though in distinct ways in its different parts), enacted rather than narrated, culminating, by means of pity and fear, in the cleansing of these passions ...So tragedy is an imitation not of people, but of action, life, and happiness or unhappiness, while happiness and unhappiness have their being in activity, and come to completion not in a quality but in some sort of action ...Therefore it is deeds and the story that are the end at which tragedy aims, and in all things the end is what matters most ...So the source that governs tragedy in the way that the soul governs life is the story.

Ch. 7 An extended whole is that which has a beginning, middle and end. But a beginning is something which, in itself, does not need to be after anything else, while something else naturally is the case or comes about after it; and an end is its contrary, something which in itself is of such a nature as to be after something else, either necessarily or for the most part, but to have nothing else after it-It is therefore needful that wellput-together stories not begin from just anywhere at random, nor end just anywhere at random ...And beauty resides in size and order ...the oneness and wholeness of the beautiful thing being present all at once in contemplation stories, just as in human organizations and in living things.

Ch. 8 A story is not one, as some people think, just because it is about one person ...And Homer, just as he is distinguished in all other ways, seems to have seen this point beautifully, whether by art or by nature.

Ch. 9 Now tragedy is an imitation not only of a complete action, but also of objects of fear and pity, and these arise most of all when events happen contrary to expectation but in consequence of one another; for in this way they will have more wonder in them than if they happened by chance or by fortune, since even among things that happen by chance, the greatest sense of wonder is from those that seem to have happened by design.

Chs. 13-14 Since it is peculiar to tragedy to be an imitation of actions arousing pity and fear ...and since the former concerns someone who is undeserving of suffering and the latter concerns someone like us ...the story that works well must ...depict a change from good to bad fortune, resulting not from badness one that arises from the actions themselves, the astonishment coming about through things that are likely, as in the Oedipus of Sophocles. A revelation, as the word indicates, is a change from ignorance to knowledge, that produces either friendship or hatred in people marked out for good or bad fortune. The most beautiful of revelations occurs when reversals of condition come about at the same time, as is the case in the Oedipus.--Ch. 11

Chs. 24-5 Wonder needs to be produced in tragedies, but in the epic there is more room for that which confounds reason, by means of which wonder comes about most of all, since in the epic one does not see the person who performs the action; the events surrounding the pursuit of Hector would seem ridiculous if they were on stage ...But wonder is sweet ...And Homer most of all has taught the rest of us how one ought to speak of what is untrue ...One ought to choose likely impossibilities in preference to unconvincing possibilities ...And if a poet has, represented impossible things, then he has missed the mark, but that is the right thing to do if he thereby hits the mark that is the end of the poetic art itself, that is, if in that way he makes that or some other part more wondrous.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle, Metaphysics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Green Lion Press, 1999.
  • Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Focus Philosophical Library, Pullins Press, 2002.
  • Aristotle, On the Soul, Joe Sachs (trans.), Green Lion Press, 2001.
  • Aristotle, Poetics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Focus Philosophical Library, Pullins Press, 2006.
  • Aristotle, Physics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Rutgers U. P., 1995.

Author Information

Joe Sachs
St. John's College
U. S. A.

Ethical Criticism of Art

Traditionally, there were two opposing philosophical positions taken with respect to the legitimacy of the ethical evaluation of art: ‘moralism’ and ‘autonomism’, where moralism is the view that the aesthetic value of art should be determined by, or reduced to, its moral value, while autonomism holds that it is inappropriate to apply moral categories to art; they should be evaluated by ‘aesthetic’ standards alone. Recent work on the ethical criticism of art has proposed several new positions; more moderate versions of autonomism and moralism which lie between the two extremes described above. The issue has now become not one of whether moral evaluations of art works are appropriate, but rather, whether they should be described as aesthetic evaluations. The contemporary debate focuses on narrative art, which is seen as having unique features to which ethical criticism is particularly pertinent. Attempts have been made to simplify the issue of the ethical criticism of art by distancing peripheral issues such as causal claims about the effects of art on its audience and censorship. However, there is still considerable interest in the possibility of certain narrative artworks having the potential to play an important role in moral education. The debate over the ethical criticism of art therefore highlights some of the central reasons why we value narrative art, as well as questioning the scope, or the parameters, of our concept of the aesthetic.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Radical Autonomism and Radical Moralism
  3. Moderate Autonomism and Moderate Moralism
    1. Moderate Autonomism
    2. Moderate Moralism
    3. Moderate Autonomism vs Moderate Moralism
  4. Moderate Moralism and Ethicism
    1. Distinguishing Moderate Moralism from Ethicism
    2. Ethicism vs Moderate Moralism
  5. The Causal Thesis
    1. Literature and Moral Education
    2. Ethical Criticism and Censorship
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

'Ethical criticism' refers to the inclusion of an ethical component in the interpretation and evaluation of art. The two traditional opposing positions taken with respect to ethical criticism are 'autonomism' and 'moralism'. The former claims that ethical criticism is never legitimate since moral and aesthetic value are autonomous, while the latter reduces aesthetic value to moral value. The extreme versions of autonomism and moralism, their appeal and their flaws, are discussed in section two.

In recent years, debate over ethical criticism has resurfaced, partly through the Ethical Criticism Symposium featured in Philosophy and Literature in 1997-8, which is discussed in the final section of this article, since it bears on the consideration of the causal thesis that certain literature can have positive moral effects on its audience. A second arm of the ethical criticism debate saw several more moderate, and more plausible, positions proposed. These are 'moderate autonomism', ‘moderate moralism’ and ‘ethicism’. In this body of literature too, the focus was on narrative art. What is at issue in the current debate is whether the realm of aesthetic value should be taken to include the moral value of narrative art (a) never, (b) only sometimes when an artwork displays moral features (merits or defects), or (c) whenever an artwork displays moral features (merits or defects). Due to differences between the modes of expression and content matter of the different art forms, it seems likely that what is true of the ethical criticism of narrative art, which often deals explicitly with human affairs and morality, may not be true of abstract art forms such as music and some fine arts and dance. Such art forms would require separate consideration and this is something which has not thus far been undertaken in the philosophical literature.

Section 3 considers the debate between moderate autonomism, defended by Anderson and Dean, and Noel Carroll's moderate moralism, examining Carroll's reasons for arguing that at least sometimes the moral features of narrative artworks are also aesthetic features. Section 4 introduces Berys Gaut's 'ethicism’, and examines the contention, made primarily by Anderson and Dean, that moderate moralism and ethicism are one and the same position. This claim is shown to be false, and the two positions are clearly distinguished. Much of the recent debate over ethical criticism - that is the debate between moderate autonomism, moderate moralism and ethicism - focusses on the flaws in the specific arguments presented for moderate moralism and ethicism. In fact, the central issue in the debate over ethical criticism, which is somewhat masked by the details, is how broadly the aesthetic should be defined. While the extreme positions, radical autonomism and radical moralism define the aesthetic most narrowly, the position which defines the aesthetic most broadly and inclusively is ethicism.

2. Radical Autonomism and Radical Moralism

There are two extreme positions traditionally taken with respect to the relationship between art and morality; one is autonomism, or aestheticism, which is the view that it is inappropriate to apply moral categories to artworks, and that only aesthetic categories are relevant, while at the other end of the scale is moralism, the view that aesthetic objects should be judged wholly or centrally with respect to moral standards or values. Both autonomism and moralism are widely recognised to be problematic, as they are based on inadequate conceptions of art and aesthetic value.

Radical Moralism is the view that the aesthetic value of an artwork is determined by its moral value. The most extreme version of this position reduces all aesthetic value to moral value. Proponents of radical moralism include Tolstoy, who, arguing against definitions of art that equated art with beauty, said: "The inaccuracy of all these definitions arises from the fact that in them all ... the object considered is the pleasure art may give, and not the purpose it may serve in the life of man and of humanity." Tolstoy emphasised the moral significance of art in society as essential to the (aesthetic) value of art. Social reductionism, such as the 'popular aesthetic' endorsed by Pierre Bourdieu, Roger Taylor and others, is also a version of radical moralism. Radical moralism has been widely criticised for ignoring certain fundamental aspects of aesthetic value, such as formal features. The radical moralist will have some difficulty explaining how art can be distinguished from other cultural products, including such things as political speeches, due to their failure to include in their criteria for making judgments about aesthetic value anything that is a unique feature of art.

Autonomism and aestheticism are essentially the same position. The label 'autonomism’ captures the fact that this position holds that aesthetic value is autonomous from other kinds of value, such as moral value. The label 'aestheticism' captures the fact that the position emphasises the importance of focussing on theaesthetic, that is, the pure aesthetic, features of artworks. Pure aesthetic qualities may include formal features and beauty or, for some autonomists, formal features only. It is important to note that formalism and autonomism are not identical positions, although advocates of formalism will tend to be autonomists. Formalism, rejected earlier, is the view that the proper way to respond to art is to respond to its formal features or, in other words, that the aesthetic value of an artwork is determined solely by its formal features. A formalist, such as Clive Bell, would not include beauty as something we should respond to in art, but those formalists who do include beauty regard it as something that is determined by the formal features the artwork possesses.

"Aestheticism' is perhaps the more appropriate label for the extreme position subscribed to by the aesthete - that aesthetic value is the highest of all values. Interestingly, although the aesthete might not be interested in defending their position, any attempt to do so would likely involve appeals to moral standards; that is, they would have to give a justification for their view that one should take on a predominantly aesthetic attitude in life in terms of moral value. For example, Richard Posner, in 'Against Ethical Criticism', appears to identify himself as an aesthete, but, ironically, an aesthete who wants to provide a moral justification for his position: "The aesthetic outlook is a moral outlook, one that stresses the values of openness, detachment, hedonism, curiosity, tolerance, the cultivation of the self, and the preservation of a private sphere - in short, the values of liberal individualism."(1997, p. 2) Aestheticism, in it's most extreme form, could almost be seen as a version of radical moralism. In any case, both positions are equally reductive with respect to the scope of aesthetic value.

However, 'aestheticism' does not always refer to the extreme position, and the terms ‘autonomism’ and 'aestheticism' can be used interchangeably. Autonomism has become the predominant term used in recent literature, most likely because it does capture the notion that aesthetic value is held to be an autonomous realm of value by those who subscribe to any version of this position. Radical Autonomism is the view that the proper way to respond to art is to respond only to the pure aesthetic qualities, or what is 'in the work itself'; while to bring moral values, or other social values, to bear on art is a mistake. The radical autonomist's motto is 'art for art’s sake’. Oscar Wilde is an example of a radical autonomist. He wrote in the Preface to The Picture of Dorien Gray: " art's subject matter we should be more or less indifferent," and "Life is the solvent that breaks up art, the enemy that lays waste her house.” Wilde's statements on the topic of and and morality are those of an autonomist, although the subject matter of his own work dealt explicitly with moral issues. His position appears to have been not that literary art can't deal with moral issues as part of its subject matter, but simply that they are irrelevant to the aesthetic value of the art, and should not influence the audience's, or critic’s, aesthetic response to the work. An autonomist position such as this is based on a narrow understanding of the aesthetic value of art, which values the way in which the subject matter of such art is represented (which may include formal features and beauty), but not the subject matter itself (which may include moral features). However, autonomism, while purporting to give aesthetic value primacy, neglects many of the potential ways in which art can have aesthetic value. Such a view ignores the fact that certain art forms are culturally embedded, and, as such, are inextricably bound up with important social values, such as moral value.

Noel Carroll explains the appeal of radical autonomism with reference to the "common denominator argument"; that is, the argument that it is only those features common to all art that are the essential defining features of art, and it is only these features that should properly be regarded as being within the realm of the aesthetic. (See 'Moderate Moralism', BJA, 36:3, 1996) As Carroll points out, the fact that radical autonomists have a ready answer to the questions -What are the unique and essential features common to all art? - or - What are the defining features of art? - is a central reason for the appeal of their position. This feature of autonomism appears to provide a straightforward way of distinguishing art from non-art, as well as providing specific grounds upon which to defend the objectivity of aesthetic value. A further reason autonomism initially seems intuitive is that it is difficult to see how moral considerations could be pertinent across whole art forms, such as music, and abstract art of various kinds.(p. 226) The above reasons make radical autonomism an attractive position, but its narrow construal of the aesthetic is too narrow to adequately account for the aesthetic value of certain art forms, or particular artworks. Besides, as was discussed earlier, attempting to define art in terms of essential criteria common to all artworks is not a promising strategy; the nature of art defies such restrictions. Carroll argues that "we can challenge [the radical autonomist's] appeal to the nature of art with appeals to the natures of specific art forms or genres which, given what they are, warrant at least additional criteria of evaluation to supplement whatever the autonomist claims is the common denominator of aesthetic evaluation." (p. 227)

What Carroll specifically has in mind is the role our moral understanding plays in our appreciation of narrative art. Carroll claims that narrative artworks are always incomplete, and that a certain amount of information has to be filled in by the reader or audience in order to make the work intelligible. This includes information which must be supplied by our moral understanding. He says: " is vastly improbable that there could be any substantial narrative of human affairs, especially a narrative artwork, that did not rely upon activating the moral powers of readers, viewers and listeners. Even modernist novels that appear to eschew 'morality' typically do so in order to challenge bourgeois morality and to enlist the reader in sharing their ethical disdain for it." (p. 228) Examples of works which require the input of our moral understanding in order to make the narrative intelligible include Jane Austin's Emma, George Elliot’s Middlemarch, and (ironically) Oscar Wilde's The Picture of Dorian Gray.

3. Moderate Autonomism and Moderate Moralism

a. Moderate Autonomism

Moderate autonomism, defended by J. Anderson and J. Dean, is a more plausible position than radical autonomism; it recognises that moral merits or defects can feature in the content of certain art forms and that sometimes moral judgments of artworks are pertinent. However, moderate autonomism is still an autonomist position in the sense that it maintains that the aesthetic value and the moral value of artworks are autonomous. According to moderate autonomism: "an artwork will never be aesthetically better in virtue of its moral strengths, and will never be worse because of its moral defects. / On a strict reading of moderate autonomism, one of its decisive claims is that defective moral understanding never counts against the aesthetic merit of a work. An artwork may invite an audience to entertain a defective moral perspective and this will not detract from its aesthetic value."(Carroll, 1996, p. 232) It is this central claim that both Carroll and Gaut argue against.

b. Moderate Moralism

Moderate autonomism stands in opposition to 'Moderate moralism': "[Moderate moralism] contends that some works of art may be evaluated morally (contra radical autonomism) and that sometimes the moral defects and/or merits of a work may figure in the aesthetic evaluation of the work." (p. 236) The crucial difference between moderate autonomism and moderate moralism, then, is that while both agree that moral judgments can be legitimately made about certain artworks, moderate moralists contend that sometimes such judgments are aesthetic evaluations, while moderate autonomists hold that moral judgments about works of art are always outside the realm of the aesthetic. On the one hand, Anderson and Dean say, "some of the knowledge that art brings home to us may be moral knowledge. All this is granted when we agree that art is properly subject to moral evaluation. But why is this value aesthetic value?" (Anderson & Dean p. 160) On the other hand, Carroll says, "Moderate autonomists overlook the degree to which moral presuppositions play a structural role in the design of many artworks."(Carroll 1996 p. 233) Carroll does not suggest that this is the only way in which moral features may contribute to a work's aesthetic value; a more general account of this is described in the following section.

c. Moderate Autonomism vs Moderate Moralism

What is really at issue in the debate over ethical criticism is how broadly we define the aesthetic. But this is not simply arbitrary - what in fact are the boundaries of the aesthetic? Carroll aims to show, with reference to specific examples, that there are actual cases where a narrow construal of the aesthetic, such as the one adopted by moderate autonomists, is an inadequate way of understanding that work's aesthetic value, and an inadequate way of understanding how we appreciate such artworks qua artworks. Even if moderate moralism is not the best way to explain the moral value of narrative artworks, Carroll is wise to turn to critical analysis of actual examples to support his argument, for this is where we can most clearly see the problems with moderate autonomism.

The central argument for moderate moralism (hereafter MM) is described as the 'Common Reason Argument.' Having first argued that many narrative artworks are incomplete in ways that require us to use our moral understanding in order to comprehend the work, Carroll then argues, with reference to examples, that because of this fact about narrative artworks, it is sometimes the case that a moral defect in a work will also be an aesthetic defect since it prevents us from fully engaging with that work. In other words, Carroll argues that in some cases the reason a work is morally flawed is the same reason the work is aesthetically flawed, and so in these cases the judgment that the work is morally flawed is also an aesthetic evaluation of that work. (Anderson & Dean, 1998, pp. 156-7) Mary Devereaux's analysis ofTriumph of the Will provides an excellent example of this. (See her article 'Beauty and Evil' in Levinson,Aesthetics & Ethics, 1998). According to Devereaux, Triumph of the Will is morally problematic because it presents the Nazi regime as appealing. Although a morally sensitive audience might be able to appreciate some of the formal features exhibited in the film, such as the innovative camera work, such an audience would be unable to fully engage with the film due to an inability to accept the film's central vision, that is, the glorification of Hitler and the Nazi regime. If the audience is unable to fully engage with the film's central vision, this, according to Carroll's MM, will count as an aesthetic defect in the film (because the magnitude of our aesthetic experience will be limited by our inability to fully engage with the film's central theme). So, the very feature that makes the film morally defective is also one of most significant aesthetic defects in the film. Hence, the moral defectiveness and the aesthetic defectiveness are due to a common reason in this particular case.

In their argument against MM, Anderson and Dean construct two arguments, a 'moral defect argument' and an 'aesthetic defect argument', which, together, they take to represent the ‘common reason argument.’ The two arguments are presented as follows:

The Moral Defect Argument

  1. The perspective of the work in question is immoral.
  2. Therefore, the work 'invites us to share [this morally] defective perspective' (In one case we are invited to find an evil person sympathetic; in the other case, we are invited to find gruesome acts humorous.)
  3. Any work which invites us to share a morally defective perspective is, itself, morally defective.
  4. Therefore, the work in question is morally defective

The Aesthetic Defect Argument

  1. The perspective of the work in question is immoral.
  2. The immorality portrayed subverts the possibility of uptake. (In the case of the tragedy, the response of pity is precluded; in the case of the satire the savouring of parody is precluded.)
  3. Any work which subverts its own genre is aesthetically defective.
  4. Therefore, the work in question is aesthetically defective. (pp. 156-7)

Anderson and Dean focus their objection to MM on the fact that the one premise the moral defect argument and the aesthetic defect argument share (1) is not sufficient to establish either moral defectiveness or aesthetic defectiveness.(p. 157) This may be so, but Carroll responds to this by pointing out the common reason doesn't need to be a sufficient reason. There may be other reasons that contribute to both the aesthetic evaluation and the moral evaluation of artworks, but in some cases these two groups of reasons overlap; where a reason is common to both groups, and is a central, if not sufficient, reason for both the conclusion that a work is morally defective, and the conclusion that the work is aesthetically defective. As Carroll puts it in his response to Anderson and Dean:

But why suppose that the relevant sense of reason here is sufficient reason? Admittedly a number of factors will contribute to the moral defectiveness and the aesthetic defectiveness of the work in question. The moderate moralist need only contend that among the complex of factors that account for the moral defectiveness of the artwork in question, on the one hand, and the complex of factors that explain the aesthetic defectiveness of the artwork, on the other hand, the evil perspective of the artwork will play a central, though perhaps not sufficient, explanatory role in both. (Carroll, 1998a, p423)

Carroll's response to Anderson and Dean’s objection is convincing. There seems no reason to object to MM simply because the common reason shared the aesthetic defect argument and the moral defect argument is not a sufficient reason in either case.

Anderson and Dean eschew specific examples in their defense of MA, saying: 'because of the complexity of particular cases, we have taken pains not to rest our case on the examination of them." (A&D, 1998, p. 164). Since MM holds that moral judgments about artworks can be aesthetic evaluations in some cases, it is only necessary to show that the reason a work is morally defective is the same as the reason that work is aesthetically defective in a few actual cases in order to support MM. Carroll does give us some convincing examples, and Anderson and Dean do not show why Carroll is wrong in these particular cases. Given that there are at least some cases, such as Devereaux's analysis of Triumph of the Will, in which it has been convincingly shown that the reason a work is morally meritorious or defective is the same reason that work is aesthetically meritorious or defective, it follows that moderate autonomism is false.

4. Moderate Moralism and Ethicism

a. Distinguishing Moderate Moralism from Ethicism

As previously mentioned, 'moderate moralism' holds that: "some works of art may be evaluated morally (contra radical autonomism) and that sometimes themoral defects and/or merits of a work may figure in the aesthetic evaluation of the work." (Carroll, 1996, p. 236, my italics) 'Ethicism' holds that: "the ethical assessment of attitudes manifested by works of art is a legitimate aspect of the aesthetic evaluation of those works, such that, if a work manifests ethically reprehensible attitudes, it is to that extent aesthetically defective, and if a work manifest ethically commendable attitudes, it is to that extent aesthetically meritorious." (See Berys Gaut's 'The Ethical Criticism of Art' in Levinson, 1998, p. 182)

Anderson and Dean claim that MM and ethicism are 'similar, if not identical' (A&D, 1998, p. 157). They must mean that the positions are similar or identical in terms of scope, since Carroll and Gaut's arguments clearly differ in detail. However, they are incorrect about this. The inclusion of 'sometimes' in Carroll’s statement of his position indicates that MM is a weaker position than ethicism - since there is no such qualification in Gaut's statement of ethicism. As Carroll himself says, in his reply to Anderson and Dean: " case is more limited in scope than Gaut's. Gaut seems willing to consider virtually every moral defect in a work of art an aesthetic defect, whereas I defend a far weaker claim - namely that sometimes a moral defect in an artwork can count as an aesthetic defect..." (Carroll, 1998a p. 419)

If we look at Gaut's arguments for ethicism, it is clear how ethicism differs from MM in scope, as well as simply in detail. The argument for ethicism runs as follows (this is taken directly from "The Ethical Criticism of Art," but I have numbered each step in the argument):

  1. A work's manifestation of an attitude is a matter of the work’s prescribing certain responses toward the events described.
  2. If those responses are unmerited, because unethical, we have reason not to respond in the way prescribed.
  3. Our having reason not to respond in the way prescribed is a failure of the work.
  4. What responses the work prescribes is of aesthetic relevance.
  5. So the fact that we have reason not to respond in the way prescribed is an aesthetic failure of the work, that is to say, is an aesthetic defect.
  6. So a work's manifestation of ethically bad attitudes is an aesthetic defect in it.
  7. Mutatis mutandis, a parallel argument shows that a work's manifestation of ethically commendable attitudes is an aesthetic merit in it, since we have reason to adopt a prescribed response that is ethically commendable.
  8. So Ethicism is true. (Gaut, in Levinson, 2000, pp. 195-6)

Notice that this argument, in particular step (2), commit Gaut to the thesis that whenever a narrative artwork displays moral features, either merits or defects, these will always impact on the aesthetic value of that work to some degree. Certain flaws in Gaut's argument have been identified by Anderson and Dean and by Carroll. The most significant of these will be examined a little later.

Early in his article, Gaut explicitly outlines the scope of ethicism. It is important to note that "ethicism does not entail the casual thesis that good art ethically improves people," nor the reverse claim; that bad art corrupts.(p. 184) Gaut describes "the ethicist principle [as] a pro tanto one: it holds that a work is aesthetically meritorious (or defective) insofar as it manifests ethically admirable (or reprehensible) attitudes. (The claim could also be put like this: manifesting ethically admirable attitudes counts towardthe aesthetic merit of a work, and manifesting ethically reprehensible attitudes counts against its aesthetic merit.) (p. 182) There is an additional qualification, that, "the ethicist does not hold that manifesting ethically commendable attitudes is a necessary condition for a work to be aesthetically good: there can be good, even great, works of art that are ethically flawed. . . .Nor does the ethicist thesis hold that manifesting ethically good attitudes is a sufficient condition for a work to be aesthetically good." (pp. 182-3) Gaut explains that "the ethicist can deny these necessity and sufficiency claims, because she holds that there are a plurality of aesthetic values, of which the ethical values of artworks are but a single kind," and he suggests "we ... need to make an all-things-considered judgment, balancing these aesthetic merits and demerits against one another to determine whether the work is, all things considered, good."(p. 183) It is these features of ethicism - its recognition of a plurality of aesthetic qualities of which moral features are one kind and its commitment to an all-things-considered judgment of aesthetic value - which make ethicism a better way of understanding how the moral features of artworks impact on their aesthetic value than MM. Ethicism does not claim that every artwork, or even every narrative artwork, does contain moral features, only that when they do, these impact on the aesthetic value of the works to some extent.

As previously noted, not only do the arguments for MM and ethicism differ in scope, but they also differ in detail; and in the detail of each arguments there are possible flaws. A possible difficulty with MM - a difficulty that Oliver Conolly identifies - lies in its reliance on the notion of an'ideal', or ‘morally sensitive' audience - the normative element in MM. (See Conolly, 'Ethicism & Moderate Moralism, BJA, 40:3, 2000)

Carroll wants to make clear that his 'ideal sensitive viewer' is not one who simply makes "whatever the work has to offer inaccessible to himself because it at first offends their moral sensibilities". He explains that "the reluctance that the moderate moralist has in mind is not that the ideally sensitive audience member voluntarily puts on the brakes; rather, it is that he can't depress the accelerator because it is jammed. He tries, but fails. And he fails because there is something wrong with the structure of the artwork. It has not been designed properly on its own terms." (Carroll, 2000, p. 378) This appears to avoid the objection that 'morally sensitive audiences' will simply impose their own moral views on artworks. However, even with this clarification, the notion of an'ideal' or, ‘morally sensitive’, audience still seems problematic.

b. Ethicism vs Moderate Moralism

Conolly suggests that there are four possible interpretations of MM; Optimistic Instrumental MM, Ideal-Spectator Instrumental MM, Standard Instrumental MM and Standard Intrinsic MM. According to Optimistic Instrumental MM, "moral virtues always happen to lead to greater audience-absorption, owing to a uniformly moral audience."(Conolly, 2000, p. 308) This interpretation of MM is not only far too optimistic, but also explicitly rejected by Carroll, who distinguishes his 'morally sensitive audiences' from actual audiences, saying, "sometimes actual audiences may fail to be deterred by a moral defect in a work because, given the circumstances, they are not as morally sensitive as they should be..."(Carroll, 2000 p. 378) He gives the example of an audience during the midst of war. This clarification also avoids the problem of explaining the moral and aesthetic value of artworks simply in terms of popular opinion. Hence, the appeal to the normative notion of an ideal audience, rather than actual audiences avoids relativism. However, Conolly points out that MM's reliance on this normative element leads to a collapse of MM into ethicism. According to Ideal Spectator MM, "[i]f only ideally moral audiences count, then ... it follows that all moral virtues / defects are also aesthetic virtues / defects." (Conolly, 2000, p. 306) Conolly explains that "[t]his is because 'morally sensitive audiences' will always react favourably to moral virtue and unfavourably to moral vice. That, one takes it, is what makes them morally sensitive."(p. 306) Conolly goes on to argue that the two other possible interpretations of MM are wrong, but I will not follow him there. The central point is that, to the extent that it relies on the notion of the ideal audience, MM collapses into ethicism, because in actual fact moral features (merits or defects) will always be aesthetic features also (merits or defects). However, it should be noted that MM's reliance on 'ideal’ or ‘morally sensitive’ audiences means that Carroll doesn't specify particular criteria upon which to base judgments about the moral defectiveness or moral virtue of artworks, but his position is compatible with such criteria, which would render the ideal audience redundant.

However, although there are valuable aspects to MM - in particular, the common reason argument has its merits - it nevertheless seems more plausible to claim, as the ethicist does, that the moral features of narrative artworks are always aesthetically relevant, i.e. they are always also aesthetic features in the sense that they impact to some degree on the overall aesthetic value of those works. One reason for this is that since MM states that moral features will only sometimes also be aesthetic features, there must be some moral features of artworks that are not aesthetically relevant, whereas no such category is required by ethicism. Carroll never explains what would distinguish a case in which moral features were aesthetically relevant from a case in which they weren't - it seems only to be a question of degree - and I suggest that it makes more sense to simply say that moral features can impact on aesthetic value to varying degrees.

I have previously mentioned that MM is more limited in scope than ethicism. Although he is not unsympathetic to Gaut's view, Carroll attempts to show that ethicism is harder to defend than MM. Carroll claims that there is a problem with what exactly is built into the notion of an unmerited response. He says that according to ethicism "[a]ll immoral responses are alleged to be unmerited in a way that is relevant to aesthetic response."(Carroll, 2000 p. 375) But Carroll questions this assumption by drawing an analogy with immoral humour. He argues: "if the ethicist means by 'unmerited' “unwarranted," then the claim with respect to artworks that all prescribed, though immoral, responses are unmerited is false, since, like a joke, the structure and content of an artwork may warrant a prescribed response that is immoral. On the other hand, if the ethicist protests that by (aesthetically) 'unmerited' he means to include "morally unmerited," then he can be charged with begging the question."(p. 376) So, Carroll concludes, the 'merited response argument' can be criticised on the grounds that "not all ethically unmerited responses to artworks are unmerited aesthetically."(p. 376) This objection can be challenged on Carroll's own terms, since ideally moral audiences presumably would not find an immoral joke (for instance a racist joke) amusing, any more than they would find Triumph of the Will engaging, it can also be challenged on the grounds that laughing at a joke is not the same thing as judging an artwork to have high aesthetic value. Sometimes we laugh at 'bad jokes', such as pathetic puns, even while we recognise them as such. Likewise, we might be entertained by a 'bad film', such as ‘Revenge of the Killer Tomatoes’ or ‘Girl On a Motorcycle’, or other such cult films, while recognising it as such all the while.

5. The Causal Thesis

While much of the recent research on ethical criticism has wrangled over what should and should not count as an aesthetic feature, a more commonplace concern about literary, or narrative, art and morality would be concerned with the possible effects those works might have on their audiences. For example, the popular Ben Elton novel Popcorn is a black comedy dealing with the issue of the effects of violent films portraying killers as attractive and powerful. However, it is desirable to keep causal claims about the harmful or 'edifying' effects of art at a distance when discussing the aesthetic relevance of the moral features of literary artworks. One of the main objections to ethical criticism made by radical autonomists is the anti-consequentialist objection that there is no evidence for causal claims about either the harmful or edifying effects of art. However, this objection assumes that ethical criticism is consequentialist, whereas it needn't be at all. (A consequentialist version of ethical criticism would hold that the moral value of artworks, or certain artworks, was determined by that work's actual effects on its audience. An expectational-consequentialist version of ethical criticism would hold that the moral value of art is determined by its likely effects on its audience.) If one rejects a consequentialist, or expectational-consequentialist, account of the moral value of art, then consideration of the effects (actual or likely) of literary artworks is a only matter for further consideration once the question of a work's moral status has been decided; it is not relevant to the judgment of that work's moral status. More work could certainly be done on the effects of artworks, however it is an area where empirical research would be required, and this is another reason causal claims have not figured highly in recent work on ethical criticism, although it should be mentioned that there is an imbalance is the extent to which positive and negative causal claims about the effects of narrative art have featured in this research.

Hence, it comes as no surprise that many of those who attempt to defend ethical criticism distance themselves from the causal thesis that morally bad art corrupts, and its counterpart, that art with high moral value morally improves its audience. Although most advocates of ethical criticism successfully avoid the negative causal thesis that bad art corrupts, many do in fact defend a version of the positive causal thesis that good art morally improves its audience. Thus, the negative thesis is avoided more assiduously than the positive, and the positive causal thesis has been more thoroughly developed. I think there are two main reasons for this. The first is that the negative thesis is not only more difficult to prove conceptually, but work in this area leads to fears about censorship of works deemed harmful. As discussed later, this fear need not preclude research on the negative effects of artworks, as the discovery that a work can have negative, or even harmful, effects on its audience does not necessarily entail that it should be censored. Another reason for the imbalance between the two sides of the causal thesis is that the positive causal thesis is more obviously relevant to discussions of the role, and value, of art in society.

It should be remembered that both the positive and negative sides of the causal thesis comprise a set of claims varying in degree. The strongest causal claims about art would be that bad art always corrupts its audience, while good art always brings about moral improvement; but any thesis this strong is intuitively implausible, and would be difficult to prove. The theses that bad art has the capacity to encourage immoral behaviour or attitudes in its audience, and that good art has the capacity to play an important role in our moral education (with the implication that these capacities may go unrealised) are rather more plausible. Martha Nussbaum has been the strongest advocate of the latter, while the former has not, to my knowledge, yet been fully explored. The following sub-section considers Nussbaum's contribution to the ethical criticism debate, in particular with respect to the role that realist literature can play in moral education.

a. Literature and Moral Education

The 'Ethical Criticism Symposium', is a debate which took place, mostly within two issues of Philosophy and Literature, (Volumes 21-22) between Richard Posner on the one hand, who argued vehemently against the legitimacy of ethical criticism, and Martha Nussbaum and Wayne Booth on the other, who defended ethical criticism. Posner has already been introduced, and identified as at least a radical autonomist, and probably an extreme autonomist / aestheticist, or in other words, an aesthete. Against those who engage in ethical criticism, with a particular focus on Martha Nussbaum and Wayne Booth, Posner employs three of the most common objections to ethical criticism: autonomism / aestheticism, cognitive triviality and anti-consequentialism. However, Posner's arguments rely on a narrow understanding of the ways in which literature can manifest moral features, and I will argue here that a broader moral context, such as that explicated in Nussbaum's work on morality and literature, makes her claims about the moral value of literature plausible. Posner's narrow understanding of moral knowledge and moral education mean that his criticisms of Nussbaum miss their mark. Nussbaum could be described as a moderate moralist (although her position is also compatible with ethicism) for although she never explicitly argues for MM, she makes two claims in her article "Exactly and Responsibly: A Defense of Ethical criticism", in which her views are strikingly similar to Carroll's 'Common Reason Argument’:

  • "Consider Booth's marvelous critique of Peter Benchley’s novel Jaws ... Booth records his critique as a moral evaluation of Benchley. But isn't it just these features of the text - its superficiality, its human barrenness, its formulaic use of persons as objects - that one would mention in an aesthetic critique?"
  • "I suggest that in general and for the most part, and only where novels are concerned, we find aesthetically pleasing only works that treat human beings as humans and not just animals or objects, that contain what I have called respect before the soul. But this quality is also moral, so we might say that in the novel aesthetic interest and moral interest are not altogether unrelated." (Nussbaum, 1998, p. 357) Carroll's overview of ethical criticism also suggests some ways of responding to the sort of objections to ethical criticism made by Posner.

Some of the main arguments against radical autonomism were presented earlier, and the position was shown to be an inadequate way of understanding aesthetic value, particularly the aesthetic value of literary art. Nussbaum, however, criticizes Posner's autonomist position on more specific grounds, claiming:

Nor, it turns out, does Posner himself consistently hold the aesthetic-detachment position. Indeed, the role he imputes to literature in human life is clearly a moral one in my sense . . . Literature, he says, 'helps us make sense of our lives, helps us to fashion an identity for ourselves.' Reading a poem of Donne, he continues, won't persuade someone who never thought about love that love is the most important thing in the world. But it may 'make you realize that this is what you think, and so may serve to clarify yourself to yourself.' That, of course, is what I have been saying all along. (p359)

Nussbaum is right to point out the inconsistency. As with the rather ironic quotation, in which Posner provides a moral justification for an extreme aestheticism (see section two), there are times when he uses moral discourse in his analysis of the aesthetic value of a work of literature - only he doesn't seem to recognise it as such. There appear to be two main reasons why Posner objects so strongly to ethical criticism, and especially to Nussbaum's employment of it. First, Posner’s understanding of ethics is very much a traditional 'justice ethics', and thus he is already at odds with Nussbaum, who’s understanding of ethics is somewhat broader. She says:

One can think of works of art which can be contemplated reasonably well without asking any urgent questions about how one should live. Abstract formalist paintings are sometimes of this character, and some intricate but non-programmatic works of music (though by no means all). But it seems highly unlikely that a responsive reading of any complex literary work is utterly detached from concerns about time and death, about pain and the transcendence of pain, and so on -- all the material of 'how one should live' questions as I have conceived it. Thus, even with regard to works I don't talk about at all -- poetic dramas, lyric poems, novels by novelists very different from Dickens and James -- the aesthetic-detachment thesis is implausible if we use 'ethical' and ‘moral’ in the broad sense that I have consistently and explicitly given it. (Nussbaum, 1998, p. 358)

Nussbaum's understanding of morality is informed not only by Aristotle, but also by Iris Murdoch’s work, and by the insights of feminist moral philosophy.

Nussbaum's main concern is with moral philosophy, and her interest in ethical criticism appears to stem from the desire to show the value and usefulness of a particular selection of literature to moral philosophy, and to the development of important moral skills. Thus, her perspective on ethical criticism differs from that of anyone who is approaching the topic with a central focus on aesthetics. However, Nussbaum recognises that literature can have many different purposes (1998 p. 347); she is merely pursuing one avenue. Among her responses to Posner's criticisms, she makes explicit her specific purposes in the two books to which he refers:

Posner's attack is directed at two very different works: Love’s Knowledge, where my primary concern is with moral philosophy, and with the claim that moral philosophy needs certain carefully selected works of narrative literature in order to pursue its own task in a complete way; and Poetic Justice, where my concern is with the conduct of public deliberations in democracy, and where my claim is that literature of a carefully specified sort can offer valuable assistance to such deliberations by both cultivating and reinforcing valuable moral abilities. In neither work do I make any general claims about 'literature' as such; indeed, I explicitly eschew such claims in both works, and I insist that my argument is confined to a narrow group of pre-selected works . . . (1998 p. 346)

Nussbaum goes so far as to say that is her contention that, "certain novels are, irreplaceably, works of moral philosophy. But I shall go further … the novel can be a paradigm of moral activity." (1987 p. 170) Nussbaum's central purposes for her selected literature are to demonstrate that this literature has a place amongst moral philosophy, and to argue that such literature has important role in moral education due to its capacity to help develop certain moral abilities.

Posner objects to the idea that literature should be used or interpreted as an extension of moral philosophy, and that it can contribute to moral education. There are two main objections; the first is that literature is not a unique or particularly good source of moral knowledge, the second that there is no evidence to suggest that certain literature can morally improve its audience. With reference to the former, Posner argues:

There is neither evidence nor a theoretical reason for a belief that literature provides a straighter path to knowledge about man and society than other sources of such knowledge, including writings in other fields, such as history and science, and interactions with real people. Some people prefer to get their knowledge of human nature from novels, but it doesn't follow that novels are a superior source of such knowledge to life and to the various genres of nonfiction. (Posner, 1997, p. 10)

This objection is characteristic of those Carroll describes as arguments from cognitive triviality. (Carroll, 2000, pp. 353-355) The two main claims that make up this objection are; first, that "the moral theses associated with artworks are usually in the nature of truisms," which "would hardly count as moral discoveries."(Carroll, 2000, p. 354) And secondly, the claim made explicitly by Posner (above), that the knowledge (in this case, moral knowledge), imparted by artworks is not superior to (and some object that it is actually inferior to) that imparted by moral philosophy and the sciences. As Carroll notes, one way of countering this objection:

. . . is to claim that the model of knowledge employed by the skeptic is too narrow. The skeptic, albeit encouraged by the apparent practice of many ethical critics, thinks that the knowledge that is relevant to ethical criticism takes the form of propositions -- propositions such as 'that hypocrisy is noxious' -- and goes on to say that where such propositions are abstractable from artworks they are generally overwhelmingly trivial. But some ethical critics counter that there are more forms of knowledge than 'knowledge that.' (p. 361)

As an alternative to this narrow approach to the way in which literature may be morally informative, Carroll proposes the 'acquaintance approach' as an alternative, which is best summed up in the following paragraph:

It is one thing to be told that roadways in Mumbai are massively overcrowded, it is another thing to be given a detailed description full of illustrative incidents, emotively and perceptively portrayed. The first presents the fact: the second suggests the flavour. The first tells you that the streets are congested: the second gives a sense of what that congestion is like. The ethical critic, or at least some ethical critics, then, answer skeptics by first agreeing that the propositional knowledge available in art is often trivial or platitudinous; art is not competitive with science, philosophy, history, or even much journalism in supplying 'knowledge that.' But this is not the only type of knowledge there is. There is also 'knowledge of what such and such would be like.' . . . Moreover, this kind of knowledge is especially relevant for moral reasoning. In entertaining alternative courses of action, there is a place for the imagination. (p. 362)

This is a promising strategy, and one that is consistent with Nussbaum's views. Nussbaum, again drawing on Henry James, tells us that moral knowledge restricted to propositions would be incomplete, what is needed is a broader understanding of moral knowledge: "Moral knowledge, James suggests, is not simply intellectual grasp of propositions; it is not even simply intellectual grasp of particular facts; it is perception, It is seeing a complex, concrete reality in a highly lucid and richly responsive way; it is taking in what is there, with imagination and feeling." (Nussbaum, 1987 p. 174)

Nussbaum's views are informed by the views of Iris Murdoch, as well as James, and one of the important features of Murdoch's work Nussbaum draws on is the notion that our inner lives, our perceptions, self-awareness and so on, can be moral achievements. Speaking of Maggie, a character in James' The Golden Bowl, Nussbaum says, "Her perceptions are necessary to her effort to give him up and to preserve his dignity. They are also moral achievements in their own right: expressions of love, protections of the loved, creations of a new and richer bond between them." (p. 175)) The artistic conventions and stylistic devices available to the literary artist make it possible to represent our inner lives in a very full and realistic way, through the engagement of the audiences' imaginations. Nussbaum suggests that there are some morally relevant aspects of our inner lives that can only be represented accurately through artistic representation:

I have said that these picturings, describings, feelings and communications -- actions in their own right -- have a moral value that is not reducible to that of the overt acts they engender. I have begun, on this basis, to build a case for saying that the morally valuable aspects of this exchange [between Maggie and Adam] could not be captured in a summary or paraphrase. Now I shall begin to close the gap between action and description from the other side, showing that a responsible action, as James conceives it, is a highly context-specific and nuanced and responsive thing whose rightness could not be captured in a description that fell short of the artistic. (1987 p. 176)

Thus, objections to the idea that literature can play an important role in moral education which are based on claims of cognitive-triviality are based on too narrow an understanding of moral knowledge. As Carroll argues, it is quite plausible to suppose that there are types of moral knowledge other than those which fall within a propositional model. Accounts of morality such as those proposed by Murdoch and Nussbaum, which emphasis the importance of our inner lives, provide obvious morally relevant subject matter, for which artistic representation is a highly appropriate means of communication.

However, the causal thesis Nussbaum proposes, that certain literature can help us to develop moral abilities, has not yet been fully defended here. Posner especially objects to the proposal that literature can morally improve its audience. His three main anti-consequentialist objections are; the importance of a good upbringing, literature loving Nazi's and English professors who are no more moral than anyone else. (Posner, 1997 pp. 4-5) Nussbaum responds to this by clarifying the scope of her claims about the positive effects of literature, pointing out that:

I am fully in agreement with Posner that the phenomenon he designates as 'empathy' is not sufficient to motivate good action; I never suggest that it is, and early in Poetic Justice I insist that empathy is likely to be hooked up with compassion in someone who has had a good early education in childhood, one that teaches concern for others. (Nussbaum, 1998 p. 352)

And, with respect to the latter two points:

Booth and I are talking about the interaction between novel and mind during the time of reading. We do not claim that this part of one's life invariably dominates, although we do think that if the novels are ethically good it will have a good influence, other things equal; nor do we claim that spending more time reading novels will make it more likely that this part will dominate. Moreover, reading can only have the good effects we claim for it if one reads with immersion, not just as a painful duty. (1998 p. 353)

Having thus clarified that hers is a moderate causal thesis about the possible positive effects of morally commendable literature, as one among many influences, Nussbaum's position seems to stand up to Posner’s objections quite well. She only says that such literature can have morally beneficial effects, not that it will. Posner's objections are not good ones; literature may have the capacity to aid in the moral education of those who are already predisposed to learn what literature specifically has to offer, but this does not mean that this capacity will always be realised. A novel's full potential may not be realised all that often in ways other than the audience's failure to see its full moral import; the novel’s fine stylistic features may also go unappreciated by many readers.

It now remains to consider the specific ways in which literature may morally educate. Carroll has some suggestions, which he collects under the heading, 'the cultivation approach'. He explains that a further response to a skeptic such as Posner would be to:

...maintain that the skeptic's conception of education is too narrow. For the skeptic, education is the acquisition of insightful propositions about the moral life. For the advocate of the cultivation approach, education may also involve other things, including the honing of ethically relevant skills and powers (such as the capacity for finer perceptual discrimination, the imagination, the emotions, and the overall ability to conduct moral reflection) as well as the exercise and refinement of moral understanding (that is, the improvement and sometimes the expansion of our understanding of the moral precepts and concepts we already possess). As the label for this approach indicates, the educative value of art resides in its potential to cultivate our moral talents. (Carroll, 2000, p. 367)

This is clearly in keeping with Nussbaum's sentiments regarding the value of literature to moral education. What is required to make this causal thesis plausible is a departure from rigid views of the realms of aesthetics, morality and education. Rather, an account such as Nussbaum's, which emphasises those important aspects of moral education which Carroll summarizes above, finds the common ground between ethics, education and literature.

It turns out that Posner's criticisms of Nussbaum’s position are based on an understanding of morality, and moral education, which is too narrow. Posner's conception of the aesthetic, and the value of art, is also too narrow; so narrow in fact that it misses some of the central reasons why we value literary art. Rather, it may be that the moral value of literary artworks is just one feature among many contributing to their overall aesthetic value, within a broad conception of the aesthetic, such as that proposed by Gaut's ethicism. Nussbaum does not discuss what other aesthetic features might be relevant to an 'all-things-considered' judgment of aesthetic value, because it is not relevant to her primary interest. It is true that she takes certain literary works and uses them for a specific purpose which focuses on just one aspect of the whole aesthetic value of those works, but she says in her defense:

It is, of course, true that ethical and political considerations have played, and continue to play, a central role in my own literary projects. But one should not infer from this that I believe this is the only legitimate way of approaching literature -- any more than one would rightly infer from the fact that a person makes a career of playing the clarinet that this person thinks the flute an instrument not worth playing. . . . In short . . . I am a pluralist about literary approaches, holding that there are many that deserve to be respected and fostered. (1998 p. 347)

Certainly this seems a healthy attitude. Respecting approaches to literature which have a specific purpose, such as Nussbaum's work on the usefulness of literature to moral philosophy and moral development, can help us gain a more comprehensive understanding of the various reasons for which we value literary art, and the artists who create it.

b. Ethical Criticism and Censorship

Unfortunately, censorship decisions are often seen as being closely linked to judgments about the moral value of art. Censorship which restricts those art and entertainment objects available to us due to the imposition of a strict and rigid moral code is one of the great fears of the radical autonomist. However, the link between the moral value of artworks and censorship is often overemphasised. Although the ability to make judgments about the moral value, or perhaps even the effects of artworks, would sometimes be pertinent to informed, responsible decisions about censorship, judgments about the moral value, or effects, of artworks are neither sufficient nor necessary grounds upon which to base censorship decisions, since there are other relevant, and important, considerations.

To begin with, it has been maintained above that to judge a literary artwork as being morally problematic is not equivalent to judging that that work will have, or even could have, a corrupting influence on its audience; claims about the negative moral effects of artworks require a further step. As discussed earlier, causal claims about the effects of artworks, especially negative causal claims, are difficult to prove. But even if it could be shown that a particular artwork had the potential to corrupt audience members, it still does not automatically follow that that work should be censored.

There are, of course, issues of rights at stake; for instance the artist's right to the freedom of expression, and the (mature) audience's right to 'make up their own minds’ about the value of particular works, as opposed to the public's 'right’ to be protected from corrupting influences and/or obscenity. There is a large body of literature which deals with the possible effects of pornography on society (this appears to have been researched far more than the possible immoral effects of artworks), on what exactly constitutes obscenity, and on issues of competing rights and responsibilities relevant to censorship. When one reviews the extent of this literature, it becomes clear that there are a great many issues to be considered with respect to censorship, of which the moral value of artworks is but one.

In fact, it is possible for partial censorship decisions, that is, restricted access rather than a complete ban, to be made without any reference to a work's moral value at all. As discussed earlier, the strong causal thesis that certain artworks will corrupt their audience is implausible, given that at least some audience members may resist the corrupting influence of the artwork, and would be very difficult to prove; empirical as well as conceptual investigation would be required. It seems likely that the most we could be sure of is that a certain artwork had the potential to corrupt some audience members. The obvious next question is which audience members would be most likely to be affected. This is partly what is behind the film and television classification scheme; a kind of scaled censorship. The criterion here for the recommended restrictions on the audience is simply age. But the possibility that such works might morally corrupt some of their audience is not the only reason for classifying some such works as suitable for only an adult audience. More often the concern is simply that the issues raised by certain films or television programs are issues only a person of a certain age could properly grasp. Some films might be deemed too confusing, too frightening, or too explicit for a young audience's comfort level, for instance, regardless of the moral status of those films. In these cases, a limited censorship is decided largely by judging what is appropriate for certain age groups, and this need not have anything to do with a work's moral value.

This very brief comment on censorship is only intended to point out that although the ability to make sound moral judgments about artworks is sometimes relevant to censorship decisions, it isn't always, and, furthermore, the judgment that a work is immoral is not sufficient grounds for that work to be censored; there are other pertinent issues to be taken into account. While a thesis such as this one could provide a starting point for further discussion on those censorship decisions which are based on judgments about the moral value of literary artworks, the issue of censorship is a substantial topic, which needs to be dealt with separately from the subject of the moral value of literary art.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Anderson, J.C. & Dean, J.T., "Moderate Autonomism," British Journal of Aesthetics, (Vol. 38, Issue 2, 1998).
    • Defends 'moderate autonomism', arguing against both moderate moralism and ethicism.
  • Beardsley, M.C., Aesthetics: Problems in the Philosophy of Criticism, (New York: Harcourt, Brace & World, Inc., 1958).
    • Considers some of the main issues in philsophical aesthetics.
  • Beardsmore, R.W., Art & Morality, (London: Macmillan, 1971).
    • This book covers the more traditional positions on the ethical criticism of art.
  • Bell, C., "Significant Form," (1914) in J. Hospers (ed.), Introductory Readings in Aesthetics, (N.Y.: The Free Press, 1969).
    • An argument for a narrow version of 'formalism' with respect to the evaluation of art.
  • Booth, W., "Why Banning Ethical Criticism is a Serious Mistake," Philosophy and Literature, (Vol. 22, 1998).
    • A defence of the practice of the ethical criticism of art; particularly targetting Posner's arguments against it.
  • Carroll, N., "Moderate Moralism," British Journal of Aesthetics, (Vol. 36, No. 3, 1996).
    • Introduces and defines the positions 'moderate autonomism' and ‘moderate moralism’, defending the latter against any form of autonomism.
  • Carroll, N., "Moderate Moralism versus Moderate Autonomism," British Journal of Aesthetics, (Vol. 38, Issue 4, 1998a).
    • A further defence of 'moderate moralism' against objections from moderate autonomists, J.C. Anderson and J.T. Dean.
  • Carroll, N., "Art, Narrative and Moral Understanding," in Levinson, J. (ed.), Aesthetics and Ethics, (Cambridge: CUP, 1998b).
    • An argument for the leitimacy of the ethical criticism of narrative froms of art.
  • Carroll, N., "Art and Ethical Criticism: An Overview of Recent Directions of Research," Ethics, (Vol. 110, 2000).
    • Explains the three main forms of objection to ethical criticism - autonomism, cognitive triviality and anti-consequentialism - and attempts to answer each of these objections, defnding 'moderate moralism.
  • Conolly, O., "Ethicism and Moderate Moralism," British Journal of Aesthetics, (Vol. 40, Issue 3), 2000.
    • Considers some possible interpretations of 'moderate moralism', compares moderate moralism with 'ethicism' and defends ethicism as the more plausible of the two positions
  • Devereaux, M., "Beauty and Evil: the case of Leni Riefensthal's Triumph of the Will," in J. Levinson (ed.), Aesthetics and Ethics, (Cambridge: CUP, 1998).
    • Gives a detailed analysis of the morally problematic film Triumph of the Will, and through this analysis argues that 'formalism' and sophisticated formalism' are inadequate ways of responding to such a film.
  • Gaut, B., "The Ethical Criticism of Art," in Levinson, J. (ed.), Aesthetics and Ethics, (Cambridge: CUP, 1998).
    • Proposes a new position with respect to the ethical criticism of art, ethicism, which argues for an 'all-things-considered' evaluation of aesthetic value which takes into account any moral merits or defects exhibited by an artwork.
  • Kieran, M., "In Defence of the Ethical Evaluation of Art," British Journal of Aesthetics, (Vol. 41, Issue 1, 2001).
    • Argues for an ammendment to Carroll's 'moderate moralism’, called ‘most moderate moralism’, which focusses on the intelligibility of artworks.
  • Levinson, J. (ed.), Aesthetics & Ethics, (Cambridge: CUP, 1998).
    • A selection of essays at the interesection of ethics and aesthetics, most of the essays dealing with ethical issues in narrative art.
  • Nussbaum, M., "Exactly and Responsibly: A Defense of Ethical Criticism," Philosophy and Literature, (Vol. 22, 1998).
    • A defense of the practice of ethical criticism; in particular a defense of Nussbaum's thesis that certain works of literature potentially play an important supplementary role in moral education.
  • Nussbaum, M., "Finely Aware and Richly Responsible: Literature and the Moral Imagination," in Cascardi, A.J. (ed.), Literature and the Question of Philosophy, (Baltimore and London: The John Hopkins University Press, 1987).
    • Explains the view described above with detailed reference to the novels of Henry James.
  • Posner, R., "Against Ethical Criticism," Philosophy and Literature, (Vol. 21, 1997).
    • Argues against the practice of ethical criticism on the grounds of autonomism, cognitive triviality and anti-consequentialism.
  • Posner, R., "Against Ethical Criticism: Part Two," Philosophy and Literature, (Vol. 22:2, 1998).
    • Responds to Nussbaum and Booth's defence of ethical criticism against Posner’s original article.
  • Stow, S., "Unbecoming Virulence: The Politics of the Ethical Criticism Debate," Philosophy and Literature, (Vol. 24, 2000).
    • Suggests ways in which the debate between Posner, Nussbaum and Booth over the ethical criticism of art was heavily influenced by their respective political differences.
  • Tolstoy, L., What Is Art? (London: Bristol Classical Press, 1994).
    • For the purposes of this subject, the significant aspect of Tolstoy's book is his emphasis on the moral import of art in society as essential to the (aesthetic) value of that art. Tolstoy is a 'radical moralist' with respect to the ethical criticism of art.
  • Wilde, O., "The Preface to The Picture of Dorian Gray," in Wilde, O., Plays, Prose Writings and Poems, (London: J.M. Dent & Sons, 1975).
    • In the preface to his, ironically, very moral story, Wilde claims that the moral merits or defects of art should in no way influence its aesthetic evaluation.

Author Information

Ella Peek

Art and Epistemology

art-epThe relationship between art and epistemology has been forever tenuous and fraught with much debate. It seems fairly obvious that we gain something meaningful from experiences and interactions with works of art. It does not seem so obvious whether or not the experiences we have with art can produce propositional knowledge that is constituted by true justified belief. In what follows I will give some historical background on the debate and flesh out some of the important issues surrounding the question “(What) can we learn from art?”

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Plato and Aristotle
  3. Rationalists, Empiricists, and Romantics
  4. Knowledge Claims about the Arts
  5. Art and Moral Knowledge
  6. Additional Objections
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

While engaging objects aesthetically is both a perceptual and emotionally laden activity, it is also fundamentally cognitive. As such, aesthetic engagement is wedded to a number of epistemological concerns. For example, we commonly claim to know things about art, and we respect what critics say about various genres of art. We say that we thought the play was good or bad, that the emotions it produced were warranted, justified, manipulative, or appropriate. People commonly claim that they learn from art, that art changes their perception of the world, and that art has an impact on the way that they see and make sense of the world. It is also widely believed that works of art, especially good works of art, can engender beliefs about the world and can, in turn, provide knowledge about the world. But what is it exactly that we can know about art? What is it precisely that art can teach us? Is there any sort of propositional content that art can provide which resembles the content that we claim to need for other kinds of knowledge claims? These are the sorts of questions that frame the debate about whether, and in what sense, art is cognitive.

2. Plato and Aristotle

The question whether or not we can learn from art goes as far back as Plato, as he warned about the dangers of indulging in both mimetic and narrative representations of the world and of human actions. The ensuing debate has endured in the contemporary philosophical literature and has spurred the further question of how we can learn from art. The arguments both for and against the notion that we can learn from art have developed as well. The debate is not any less complicated than it was historically, nor is it any closer to being resolved.

There are two extreme positions that one could take in answer to the question, "Can we learn from art?" Either we can, and do, learn from art, or we cannot in any meaningful sense attain knowledge that is non-propositional. Those who argue that we can learn from art generally argue that our engagement with art arouses certain emotions or activities that are able to facilitate or produce knowledge. They would argue that there is some aspect of the artwork which can help to produce greater understanding of the world around us. Art is thus seen as a source of insight and awareness that cannot be put into propositional language; but it can help us to see the world in a new or different way.

Those who deny that we can learn from art often argue that there can be no knowledge that is not propositionally-based knowledge. Jerome Stolnitz, for example, claims in a 1992 article that art does not and cannot contribute to knowledge primarily because it does not generate any sort of truths. Those who argue this line want to defend the notion that since art cannot provide facts or generate arguments, then we cannot learn from it. Further, those who believe we cannot learn from art argue that art cannot be understood as a source of knowledge because it is not productive of knowledge, taken in the traditional sense of justified true belief. Art does not have propositional content that can be learned in a traditional way, even though it can been seen to have effects that promote knowledge and that can either encourage or undermine the development of understanding. Art can thus be rejected as a source of knowledge because it does not provide true beliefs, and because it does not and cannot justify the beliefs that it does convey. Both extremes agree that if art can be seen as a source of knowledge, the only way that it could possibly fulfill such a function would be if that knowledge reflected something essential to art's nature and value.

Plato points out in the Republic (595-601) that it is possible to make a representation of something without having knowledge of the thing represented. Painters represent cobblers when the painters have no knowledge of shoemaking themselves, and poets write about beauty and courage without necessarily having any clear knowledge of these virtues. Only philosophers, the lovers of wisdom, and especially those who strive to intuit the Forms and employ abstract reasoning, can really have knowledge of these virtues. Artists mislead their viewers into thinking that knowledge lies in the represented (mimetic) object. Plato's concern in the Republic extends to the literary arts in particular, which are created with the express purpose to move us emotionally in such a way that one's character could be corrupted (605-608). The more one indulges in emotions aroused by representation, according to Plato, the more likely one is to suffer the effects of an unbalanced soul, and ultimately the development of a bad character.

Aristotle agreed with Plato that art could indeed influence the development of one's moral character. While Plato thought that we can learn from art and that it is detrimental to one's character, however, Aristotle argued that indulging in the same mimetic emotions that Plato warned us of can actually benefit one's character by producing an emotional catharsis (Poetics 1449b24-29). By purging the tragic emotions in particular, Aristotle held, one has a better chance of being more rational in everyday life. Thus, while both philosophers believed that we learn from art, one (Plato) argued that the knowledge gained was detrimental while the other (Aristotle) argued that it was beneficial.

3. Rationalists, Empiricists, and Romantics

Continuing with the line of argument Aristotle began, all the way through the Renaissance and beyond, philosophers have defended the notion that we can learn from art, and that poetry and fiction engage the emotions in a helpful, rather than detrimental, way. The Romantics dealt with this question in a manner that the earlier rationalists and empiricists did not. The rationalists rejected the idea that the imagination could be considered a source of knowledge, with Descartes going so far as to dismiss what he called "the blundering constructions of the imagination." Returning to the ideals of Plato, the rationalists strictly employed a knowledge requirement involving justified true belief. Empiricist epistemology too is particularly unhelpful when it comes to explaining how we might gain justified knowledge from fictional or representational situations. For it seems impossible to learn actual things from fictional situations.

The Romantics provided the real beginnings of an argument against the passive accounts of knowledge for which the empiricists argued. Romantic epistemology emphasizes the role of the imagination in addition to (or over) reason. This allowed for the notion that there is not merely one right way to know, and that there is not only one right way to view, experience, understand, and construct the world.

The Romantics adopted three main tenets concerning the relationship between literature (and art more generally) and truth. The first denied that there is any one point of view from which Truth can be determined. The second began to question the Augustinian conviction that art and literature, like science, should concern only general features of nature. The third tenet, which the Romantics developed more fully, concerned the notion of transcendence, especially in association with growth. Natural science is able to describe the physical world, but only from a single point of view (Harrison 1998). Art and literature can describe the world in a myriad of ways, transcending experience of the physical world into the emotional and even the supernatural. Although art does not record truths about the world in the same way that science does, it can give insight into the different ways that we understand the world and with different degrees of accuracy. It is those degrees of accuracy that continue to be called into question.

4. Knowledge Claims about the Arts

David Novitz (1998) points out that there are three basic kinds of knowledge claims we can make about the arts, all of which are distinguished by their objects. The first concerns what we claim to know or believe about the art object itself and whatever imaginary or fictional worlds might be connected to that object. For example, I can claim to know things about the way the light reflects in Monet's Water Lilies. I can also claim to know things about Anna Karenina's relationships with her husband and with her lover, Vronsky. Beyond this, we may feel justified in our pity for Anna, because of the way Tolstoy's novel presents her story. Can my knowledge of Anna be meaningful, however, or be considered knowledge at all in the traditional sense (justified true belief) if Anna Karenina is a non-referring name? Further, how can one's interpretation of her situation be any more legitimate than anyone else's? Can single interpretations hold value over time and across cultures? Without the propositional content used to legitimize the standard analysis of knowledge, it seems that the knowledge claims we have about the content of an artwork will never have the same kind of validity. Whether or not that same kind of validity is required also needs to be called into question.

The second kind of knowledge claim we can make about art concerns what we know or believe to be an appropriate or warranted emotional response to the artwork. We often believe that works of art are only properly understood if we have a certain kind of emotional response to them. One problem here, of course, concerns how it is that we know what kind of response is appropriate to a particular work. On occasion we talk to friends about a response they had to a particular work of art that was manifestly different from the one we had. How is it possible to judge which response is more appropriate or justified? Even suggesting that one should respond as if a novel, for example, were to be taken as an account of true events, with responses following as if the events depicted therein were actually happening or had happened, does not solve the problem. For one thing, not all emotional responses to real events are taken as equally justified. For another, most novels are not meant to be taken as true (despite the "report model" of emotive response [see Matravers 1997]). The fact that we do respond emotively to art, and to fiction in particular, would seem to indicate that there is something in the artwork that is worth responding to, even if it is not the same thing possessed by the objects we respond to outside the art world.

The third kind of knowledge claim we can have about art concerns the sort of information art can provide about the world. That is, how is it that we can gain real knowledge from fictional or non-real events or activities? It is widely accepted that art does, in fact, convey important insight into the way we order and understand the world. It is also widely acknowledged that art gives a certain degree of meaning to our lives. Art, and literature in particular, can elicit new beliefs and even new knowledge about the world. But the concern is this: fiction is not produced in a way that is reflective of the world as it actually is. It might be quite dangerous, in fact, for one to obtain knowledge about human affairs only from fiction. For example, it could be downright unhealthy for me to get my sense of what it is like to be in love from romance novels alone.

We can easily be experientially misled by art. The so-called empathic beliefs, those we gain from experiencing art, should be based on and enhanced by our broader experience of the world and should not arise independently of our other beliefs. But here the problem of justification returns. That is, if the empathic beliefs we gain from our experience of art actually coincide with our experience of the real world, then they can pass as empathic knowledge (that is, beliefs become true and justified when they are connected to other justified beliefs). The problem is that often the emotions and beliefs that we adopt empathically turn out to be temporary, since they are not grounded in concrete experience. Can the experience we have with a work of art be confirming in and of itself, or must there be another, external authority to make the experience, or at least the knowledge gained from the experience, legitimate? It seems that much of what we learn about the world does come from art, and thus the justificatory claims to knowledge must be reconsidered.

The propositional theory of knowledge holds that one must have justified true belief in the content of a proposition in order to have knowledge. This appears reasonable under normal circumstances, but seems not to work at all in the case of art. It seems odd, in fact, to hold that in order to show that one has learned from a work of fiction, one must show that the work has propositional content of a general or philosophical nature, or that it provides experience that cannot be gained in any other way. If we can learn from art, we must be able to do so in a manner that diverges from the traditional notion of justified true belief, but that still holds some sort of legitimate ground.

What kind of justification is needed to ground these potential knowledge claims that art provides? First of all, we must be at least somewhat aware of what the new knowledge consists of. Moreover, one's engagement with the artwork should provide at least some degree of justification (e.g., I feel pity for Anna Karenina because she is in an unfortunate set of circumstances that she feels she has no control over. I am justified in my emotional response to her if I can see that she is in a truly pitiable situation). It is important to distinguish learning from art from merely being affected or influenced by it, or even from being challenged by it. Accounts of knowledge provided by art should be able to identify clearly what it is about the artwork itself, qua artwork, which prompts knowledge. A cognitivist account in particular will require first that the content of the work be specifiable (what is it we learn?); second, that the demands for justification be respected; and third, that these accounts appeal directly to aesthetic experience (Freeland 1997).

5. Art and Moral Knowledge

It would seem that there is indeed something about the content of an artwork that can be said to be knowledge-producing. But how can that be so? The artist himself or herself is not the ultimate authority here, since his/her knowledge or expertise is not necessarily directly transferred into the artwork. Furthermore, even if it were capable of being transferred clearly, it is not always the case that observers will interpret the meaning or significance of a work of art in any standard way. What the artist knows and how others experience his/her art are not directly related enough to justify epistemic legitimacy. It also seems unjustified to assume that there are intrinsic features of an artwork that are always clearly identifiable. So the knowledge we gain from art has more to do with the relationship between the art object and the consumer than anything else.

Another way we might argue for the possibility of gaining knowledge from art is by rejecting the justified true belief account of knowledge. There might be more than one way to know, in other words, and more than one way to learn. One of the most common alternative suggestions concerning the knowledge that art elicits is that it is moral knowledge that we gain. These arguments are based primarily of the presumption that art, and literature especially, can provide experiential and emotional stimulation, and that moral knowledge is not simply propositional in nature. It has been objected, however, that such stimulation is not equal to the propositional content that more traditional forms of knowledge can provide.

Eileen John (2001) identifies two arguments for the claim that moral knowledge can be gained from art. The first argument stresses the capacity of art to give us examples of, and exercise in, certain morally pertinent activities. Thus, we come across circumstances and situations in art and literature that we might not otherwise come across in our daily lives. If we simulate our own reactions to the situations the work presents us with, we have an idea of how we might respond or how we would feel (see especially Kendall Walton's theory of Make-Believe and Simulation Theory). On this view, works of art can provide us with simulated or "off-line" emotional responses that could not be achieved otherwise.

The second argument is based on the assumption that we can acquire specific substantive moral knowledge from art. That is, works of art are taken to possess the ability to give us imaginative and epistemic access to certain kinds of experiences relevant to moral knowledge and judgment. Not only can we respond emotionally to particular moral situations presented through artworks; we cannot help but find ourselves morally outraged or saddened by the plights of certain fictional characters.

6. Additional Objections

Noël Carroll (2002) lays out three additional objections to the suggestion that art can provide knowledge. The first objection he calls the "banality argument": the idea that “the significant truths that many claim art and literature may afford—that is, general truths about life, usually of an implied nature (as opposed to what is 'true in the fiction')—are in the main, trivial." Compared to the knowledge we are able to obtain from propositional statements and arguments, the kind of things works of literature are can point out are so obvious as to be useless. Carroll continues by stating that "art and knowledge are not sources of moral knowledge, but, at best, occasions for activating antecedently possessed knowledge." The best it seems that art and literature can do is to point out things we already know and believe.

The second objection Carroll outlines against the notion that we can learn from art is what he calls the "no-evidence argument." This focuses on the fact that not only is anything we gain from art and literature banal, but for any knowledge to be legitimate, it needs to be warranted and must be supported by evidence. Few artworks, however, supply any evidence at all in defense of a particular view. One of the reasons interpretations seem to legitimately vary so widely is precisely due to this lack of solid evidence. Moreover, fiction is not a reliable source of evidence when it comes to literature and other arts.

Carroll calls the third objection the "no-argument argument." As he explains, “it maintains that even if artworks contained or implied general truths, neither the artworks themselves nor the critical discourse that surrounds them engages in argument, analysis, and debate in defense of the alleged truths." If artworks do indeed suggest any sort of knowledge, Carroll points out, it can only be suggested or implied but never argued for or defended. Furthermore, the critical discourse that surrounds artworks is not generally focused on arguing for or against any of the claims made in the artwork itself.

7. Conclusion

The fact that we do respond to works of art, and that we commonly believe we can and do learn from such works, is not enough to justify that learning actually occurs. However, it is enough to make us examine our presuppositions about what constitutes knowledge, and perhaps may lead us to reconceive knowledge in such a way that we may eventually come to understand how it can be gained non-propositionally.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Bender, John. "Art as a Source of Knowledge: Linking Analytic Aesthetics and Epistemology." In Contemporary Philosophy of Art, ed. John Bender and Gene Blocker. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice Hall, 1993.
  • Carroll, Noël. "Art, Narrative, and Moral Understanding." In Aesthetics and Ethics: Essays at the Intersection, ed. Jerrold Levinson. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Carroll, Noël. "Moderate Moralism." British Journal of Aesthetics 36 (1996): 223-38.
  • Carroll, Noël. "The Wheel of Virtue: Art, Literature, and Moral Knowledge." Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 60.1 (Winter 2002): 3-26.
  • Diffey, T.J. "What Can We Learn From Art?" Australasian Journal of Philosophy 73 (1995): 202-11.
  • Freeland, Cynthia. "Art and Moral Knowledge." Philosophical Topics 25.1 (Spring 1997): 11-36.
  • Graham, Gordon. "Value and the Visual Arts." Journal of Aesthetic Education 28 (1994): 1-14.
  • Graham, Gordon. "Learning From Art." British Journal of Aesthetics 35 (1995): 26-37.
  • Harrison, Bernard. "Literature and Cognition." In Encyclopedia of Aesthetics, ed. Michael Kelly. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998.
  • John, Eileen. "Reading Fiction and Conceptual Knowledge: Philosophical Thought in Literary Context." Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 56 (1998): 331-48.
  • John, Eileen. "Art and Knowledge." The Routledge Companion to Aesthetics, eds. Berys Gaut and Dominic McIver Lopes. London: Routledge, 2001.
  • Feagin, Susan. "Paintings and Their Places." Australasian Journal of Philosophy 73.2 (1995): 260-68.
  • Kieran, Matthew. "Art, Imagination, and the Cultivation of Morals." Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 54 (1996): 337-51.
  • Lamarque, Peter and Stein Olsen. Truth, Fiction, and Literature. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1994.
  • Matravers, Derek. "The Report Model versus the Perceptual Model." In Emotion and the Arts, eds. Mette Hjort and Sue Laver. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1997, 78-92.
  • Novitz, David. "Aesthetics and Epistemology." In Encyclopedia of Aesthetics, ed. Michael Kelly. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998.
  • Nussbaum, Martha. Love's Knowledge: Essays on Philosophy and Literature. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1990.
  • Nussbaum, Martha. Poetic Justice: The Literary Imagination and Public Life. Boston: Beacon Press, 1995.
  • Reid, Louis Arnaud. "Art and Knowledge." British Journal of Aesthetics 25 (1985): 115-24.
  • Robinson, Jennifer. "L'Education Sentimentale." Australasian Journal of Philosophy 73 (1995): 212-26.
  • Stolnitz, Jerome. "On the Cognitive Triviality of Art." British Journal of Aesthetics 32 (July 1992): 191-200.
  • Walton, Kendall. Mimesis as Make Believe: On the Foundations of the Representational Arts. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1990.
  • Wilson, Catherine. "Literature and Knowledge." Philosophy 58 (1983): 489-96.
  • Young, James O. Art and Knowledge. London: Routledge, 2001.

Author Information

Sarah E. Worth
Furman University
U. S. A.


aesthetiAesthetics may be defined narrowly as the theory of beauty, or more broadly as that together with the philosophy of art. The traditional interest in beauty itself broadened, in the eighteenth century, to include the sublime, and since 1950 or so the number of pure aesthetic concepts discussed in the literature has expanded even more. Traditionally, the philosophy of art concentrated on its definition, but recently this has not been the focus, with careful analyses of aspects of art largely replacing it. Philosophical aesthetics is here considered to center on these latter-day developments. Thus, after a survey of ideas about beauty and related concepts, questions about the value of aesthetic experience and the variety of aesthetic attitudes will be addressed, before turning to matters which separate art from pure aesthetics, notably the presence of intention. That will lead to a survey of some of the main definitions of art which have been proposed, together with an account of the recent “de-definition” period. The concepts of expression, representation, and the nature of art objects will then be covered.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Aesthetic Concepts
  3. Aesthetic Value
  4. Aesthetic Attitudes
  5. Intentions
  6. Definitions of Art
  7. Expression
  8. Representation
  9. Art Objects
  10. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The full field of what might be called “aesthetics” is a very large one. There is even now a four-volume encyclopedia devoted to the full range of possible topics. The core issues in Philosophical Aesthetics, however, are nowadays fairly settled (see the book edited by Dickie, Sclafani, and Roblin, and the monograph by Sheppard, among many others).

Aesthetics in this central sense has been said to start in the early eighteenth century, with the series of articles on “The Pleasures of the Imagination” which the journalist Joseph Addison wrote in the early issues of the magazine The Spectator in 1712. Before this time, thoughts by notable figures made some forays into this ground, for instance in the formulation of general theories of proportion and harmony, detailed most specifically in architecture and music. But the full development of extended, philosophical reflection on Aesthetics did not begin to emerge until the widening of leisure activities in the eighteenth century.

By far the most thoroughgoing and influential of the early theorists was Immanuel Kant, towards the end of the eighteenth century. Therefore it is important, first of all, to have some sense of how Kant approached the subject. Criticisms of his ideas, and alternatives to them, will be presented later in this entry, but through him we can meet some of the key concepts in the subject by way of introduction.

Kant is sometimes thought of as a formalist in art theory; that is to say, someone who thinks the content of a work of art is not of aesthetic interest. But this is only part of the story. Certainly he was a formalist about the pure enjoyment of nature, but for Kant most of the arts were impure, because they involved a “concept.” Even the enjoyment of parts of nature was impure, namely when a concept was involved— as when we admire the perfection of an animal body or a human torso. But our enjoyment of, for instance, the arbitrary abstract patterns in some foliage, or a color field (as with wild poppies, or a sunset) was, according to Kant, absent of such concepts; in such cases, the cognitive powers were in free play. By design, art may sometimes obtain the appearance of this freedom: it was then “Fine Art”—but for Kant not all art had this quality.

In all, Kant’s theory of pure beauty had four aspects: its freedom from concepts, its objectivity, the disinterest of the spectator, and its obligatoriness. By “concept,” Kant meant “end,” or “purpose,” that is, what the cognitive powers of human understanding and imagination judge applies to an object, such as with “it is a pebble,” to take an instance. But when no definite concept is involved, as with the scattered pebbles on a beach, the cognitive powers are held to be in free play; and it is when this play is harmonious that there is the experience of pure beauty. There is also objectivity and universality in the judgment then, according to Kant, since the cognitive powers are common to all who can judge that the individual objects are pebbles. These powers function alike whether they come to such a definite judgment or are left suspended in free play, as when appreciating the pattern along the shoreline. This was not the basis on which the apprehension of pure beauty was obligatory, however. According to Kant, that derived from the selflessness of such an apprehension, what was called in the eighteenth century its “disinterest.” This arises because pure beauty does not gratify us sensuously; nor does it induce any desire to possess the object. It “pleases,” certainly, but in a distinctive intellectual way. Pure beauty, in other words, simply holds our mind’s attention: we have no further concern than contemplating the object itself. Perceiving the object in such cases is an end in itself; it is not a means to a further end, and is enjoyed for its own sake alone.

It is because Morality requires we rise above ourselves that such an exercise in selfless attention becomes obligatory. Judgments of pure beauty, being selfless, initiate one into the moral point of view. “Beauty is a symbol of Morality,” and “The enjoyment of nature is the mark of a good soul” are key sayings of Kant. The shared enjoyment of a sunset or a beach shows there is harmony between us all, and the world.

Among these ideas, the notion of “disinterest” has had much the widest currency. Indeed, Kant took it from eighteenth century theorists before him, such as the moral philosopher, Lord Shaftesbury, and it has attracted much attention since: recently by the French sociologist Pierre Bourdieu, for instance. Clearly, in this context “disinterested” does not mean “uninterested,” and paradoxically it is closest to what we now call our “interests,” that is, such things as hobbies, travel, and sport, as we shall see below. But in earlier centuries, one’s “interest” was what was to one’s advantage, that is, it was “self-interest,” and so it was the negation of that which closely related aesthetics to ethics.

2. Aesthetic Concepts

The eighteenth century was a surprisingly peaceful time, but this turned out to be the lull before the storm, since out of its orderly classicism there developed a wild romanticism in art and literature, and even revolution in politics. The aesthetic concept which came to be more appreciated in this period was associated with this, namely sublimity, which Edmund Burke theorized about in his “A Philosophical Enquiry into the Origin of our ideas of the Sublime and Beautiful.” The sublime was connected more with pain than pure pleasure, according to Burke, since threats to self-preservation were involved, as on the high seas, and lonely moors, with the devilish humans and dramatic passions that artists and writers were about to portray. But in these circumstances, of course, it is still “delightful horror,” as Burke appreciated, since one is insulated by the fictionality of the work in question from any real danger.

“Sublime” and “beautiful” are only two amongst the many terms which may be used to describe our aesthetic experiences. Clearly there are “ridiculous” and “ugly,” for a start, as well. But the more discriminating will have no difficulty also finding something maybe “fine,” or “lovely” rather than “awful” or “hideous,” and “exquisite” or “superb” rather than “gross” or “foul.” Frank Sibley wrote a notable series of articles, starting in 1959, defending a view of aesthetic concepts as a whole. He said that they were not rule- or condition-governed, but required a heightened form of perception, which one might call taste, sensitivity, or judgment. His full analysis, however, contained another aspect, since he was not only concerned with the sorts of concepts mentioned above, but also with a set of others which had a rather different character. For one can describe works of art, often enough, in terms which relate primarily to the emotional and mental life of human beings. One can call them “joyful,” “melancholy,” “serene,” “witty,” “vulgar,” and “humble,” for instance. These are evidently not purely aesthetic terms, because of their further uses, but they are still very relevant to many aesthetic experiences.

Sibley’s claim about these concepts was that there were no sufficient conditions for their application. For many concepts—sometimes called “closed” concepts, as a result—both necessary and sufficient conditions for their application can be given. To be a bachelor, for instance, it is necessary to be male and unmarried, though of marriageable age, and together these three conditions are sufficient. For other concepts, however, the so-called “open” ones, no such definitions can be given— although for aesthetic concepts Sibley pointed out there were still some necessary conditions, since certain facts can rule out the application of, for example, “garish,” “gaudy,” or “flamboyant.”

The question therefore arises: how do we make aesthetic judgments if not by checking sufficient conditions? Sibley’s account was that, when the concepts were not purely perceptual they were mostly metaphoric. Thus, we call artworks “dynamic,” or “sad,” as before, by comparison with the behaviors of humans with those qualities. Other theorists, such as Rudolph Arnheim and Roger Scruton, have held similar views. Scruton, in fact, discriminated eight types of aesthetic concept, and we shall look at some of the others below.

3. Aesthetic Value

We have noted Kant’s views about the objectivity and universality of judgments of pure beauty, and there are several ways that these notions have been further defended. There is a famous curve, for instance, obtained by the nineteenth century psychologist Wilhelm Wundt, which shows how human arousal is quite generally related to complexity of stimulus. We are bored by the simple, become sated, even over-anxious, by the increasingly complex, while in between there is a region of greatest pleasure. The dimension of complexity is only one objective measure of worth which has been proposed in this way. Thus it is now known, for instance, that judgments of facial beauty in humans are a matter of averageness and symmetry. Traditionally, unity was taken to be central, notably by Aristotle in connection with Drama, and when added to complexity it formed a general account of aesthetic value. Thus Francis Hutcheson, in the eighteenth century, asserted that “Uniformity in variety always makes an object beautiful.” Monroe Beardsley, more recently, has introduced a third criterion—intensity—to produce his three “General Canons” of objective worth. He also detailed some “Special Canons.”

Beardsley called the objective criteria within styles of Art “Special Canons.” These were not a matter of something being good of its kind and so involving perfection of a concept in the sense of Kant. They involved defeasible “good-making” and “bad-making” features, more in the manner Hume explained in his major essay in this area, “Of the Standard of Taste” (1757). To say a work of art had a positive quality like humor, for instance, was to praise it to some degree, but this could be offset by other qualities which made the work not good as a whole. Beardsley defended all of his canons in a much more detailed way than his eighteenth century predecessor however: through a lengthy, fine-grained, historical analysis of what critics have actually appealed to in the evaluation of artworks. Also, he explicitly made the disclaimer that his canons were the only criteria of value, by separating these “objective reasons” from what he called “affective” and “genetic” reasons. These two other sorts of reasons were to do with audience response, and the originating artist and his times, respectively, and either “The Affective Fallacy” or “The Intentional Fallacy,” he maintained, was involved if these were considered. The discrimination enabled Beardsley to focus on the artwork and its representational relations, if any, to objects in the public world.

Against Beardsley, over many years, Joseph Margolis maintained a “Robust Relativism.” Thus he wanted to say that “aptness,” “partiality,” and “non-cognitivism” characterize art appreciation, rather than “truth,” “universality,” and “knowledge.” He defended this with respect to aesthetic concepts, critical judgments of value, and literary interpretations in particular, saying, more generally, that works of art were “culturally emergent entities” not directly accessible, because of this, to any faculty resembling sense perception. The main debate over aesthetic value, indeed, concerns social and political matters, and the seemingly inevitable partiality of different points of view. The central question concerns whether there is a privileged class, namely those with aesthetic interests, or whether their set of interests has no distinguished place, since, from a sociological perspective, that taste is just one amongst all other tastes in the democratic economy. The sociologist Arnold Hauser preferred a non-relativistic point of view, and was prepared to give a ranking of tastes. High art beat popular art, Hauser said, because of two things: the significance of its content, and the more creative nature of its forms. Roger Taylor, by contrast, set out very fully the “leveller’s” point of view, declaring that "Aida" and "The Sound of Music" have equal value for their respective audiences. He defended this with a thorough philosophical analysis, rejecting the idea that there is such a thing as truth corresponding to an external reality, with the people capable of accessing that truth having some special value. Instead, according to Taylor, there are just different conceptual schemes, in which truth is measured merely by coherence internal to the scheme itself. Janet Wolff looked at this debate more disinterestedly, in particular studying the details of the opposition between Kant and Bourdieu.

4. Aesthetic Attitudes

Jerome Stolnitz, in the middle of the last century, was a Kantian, and promoted the need for a disinterested, objective attitude to art objects. It is debatable, as we saw before, whether this represents Kant’s total view of art, but the disinterested treatment of art objects which Stolnitz recommended was very commonly pursued in his period.

Edward Bullough, writing in 1912, would have called “disinterested attention” a “distanced” attitude, but he used this latter term to generate a much fuller and more detailed appreciation of the whole spectrum of attitudes which might be taken to artworks. The spectrum stretched from people who “over-distance” to people who “under-distance.” People who over-distance are, for instance, critics who merely look at the technicalities and craftwork of a production, missing any emotional involvement with what it is about. Bullough contrasted this attitude with what he called “under-distancing,” where one might get too gripped by the content. The country yokel who jumps upon the stage to save the heroine, and the jealous husband who sees himself as Othello smothering his wife, are missing the fact that the play is an illusion, a fiction, just make-believe. Bullough thought there was, instead, an ideal mid-point between his two extremes, thereby solving his “antinomy of distance” by deciding there should be the least possible distance without its disappearance.

George Dickie later argued against both “disinterest” and “distance” in a famous 1964 paper, “The Myth of the Aesthetic Attitude.” He argued that we should be able to enjoy all objects of awareness, whether “pure aesthetic” or moral. In fact, he thought the term “aesthetic” could be used in all cases, rejecting the idea that there was some authorized way of using the word just to apply to surface or formal features— the artwork as a thing in itself. As a result, Dickie concluded that the aesthetic attitude, when properly understood, reduced to just close attention to whatever holds one’s mind in an artwork, against the tradition which believed it had a certain psychological quality, or else involved attention just to certain objects.

Art is not the only object to draw interest of this pleasurable kind: hobbies and travel are further examples, and sport yet another, as was mentioned briefly above. In particular, the broadening of the aesthetic tradition in recent years has led theorists to give more attention to sport. David Best, for instance, writing on sport and its likeness to art, highlighted how close sport is to the purely aesthetic. But he wanted to limit sport to this, and insisted it had no relevance to ethics. Best saw art forms as distinguished expressly by their having the capacity to comment on life situations, and hence bring in moral considerations. No sport had this further capacity, he thought, although the enjoyment of many sports may undoubtedly be aesthetic. But many art forms—perhaps more clearly called “craft-forms” as a result— also do not comment on life situations overmuch, for example, décor, abstract painting, and non-narrative ballet. And there are many sports which are pre-eminently seen in moral, “character-building” terms, for example, mountaineering, and the various combat sports (like boxing and wrestling). Perhaps the resolution comes through noting the division Best himself provides within sport-forms, between, on the one hand, “task” or “non-purposive” sports like gymnastics, diving, and synchronized swimming, which are the ones he claims are aesthetic, and on the other hand the “achievement,” or “purposive’ sports, like those combat sports above. Task sports have less “art” in them, since they are not as creative as the purposive ones.

5. Intentions

The traditional form of art criticism was biographical and sociological, taking into account the conceptions of the artist and the history of the traditions within which the artist worked. But in the twentieth century a different, more scientific and ahistorical form of literary criticism grew up in the United States and Britain: The New Criticism. Like the Russian Formalists and French Structuralists in the same period, the New Critics regarded what could be gleaned from the work of art alone as relevant to its assessment, but their specific position received a much-discussed philosophical defense by William Wimsatt and Monroe Beardsley in 1946. Beardsley saw the position as an extension of “The Aesthetic Point of View”; Wimsatt was a practical critic personally engaged in the new line of approach. In their essay “The Intentional Fallacy,” Wimsatt and Beardsley claimed “the design or intention of the artist is neither available nor desirable as a standard for judging the success of a work of literary art.” It was not always available, since it was often difficult to obtain, but, in any case, it was not appropriately available, according to them, unless there was evidence for it internal to the finished work of art. Wimsatt and Beardsley allowed such forms of evidence for a writer’s intentions, but would allow nothing external to the given text.

This debate over intention in the literary arts has raged with full force into more recent times. A contemporary of Wimsatt and Beardsley, E.D. Hirsch, has continued to maintain his “intentionalist” point of view. Against him, Steven Knapp and Walter Benn Michaels have taken up an ahistorical position. Frank Cioffi, one of the original writers who wrote a forceful reply to Wimsatt and Beardsley, aligned himself with neither camp, believing different cases were “best read” sometimes just as, sometimes other than as, the artist knowingly intended them. One reason he rejected intention, at times, was because he believed the artist might be unconscious of the full significance of the artwork.

A similar debate arises in other art forms besides Literature, for instance Architecture, Theater, and Music, although it has caused less professional comment in these arts, occurring more at the practical level in terms of argument between “purists” and “modernizers.” Purists want to maintain a historical orientation to these art forms, while modernizers want to make things more available for contemporary use. The debate also has a more practical aspect in connection with the visual arts. For it arises in the question of what devalues fakes and forgeries, and by contrast puts a special value on originality. There have been several notable frauds perpetrated by forgers of artworks and their associates. The question is: if the surface appearance is much the same, what especial value is there in the first object? Nelson Goodman was inclined to think that one can always locate a sufficient difference by looking closely at the visual appearance. But even if one cannot, there remain the different histories of the original and the copy, and also the different intentions behind them.

The relevance of such intentions in visual art has entered very prominently into philosophical discussion. Arthur Danto, in his 1964 discussion of “The Artworld,” was concerned with the question of how the atmosphere of theory can alter how we see artworks. This situation has arisen in fact with respect to two notable paintings which look the same, as Timothy Binkley has explained, namely Leonardo’s original “Mona Lisa” and Duchamp’s joke about it, called “L.H.O.O.Q. Shaved.” The two works look ostensibly the same, but Duchamp, one needs to know, had also produced a third work, “L.H.O.O.Q.,” which was a reproduction of the "Mona Lisa," with some graffiti on it: a goatee and moustache. He was alluding in that work to the possibility that the sitter for the "Mona Lisa" might have been a young male, given the stories about Leonardo’s homosexuality. With the graffiti removed the otherwise visually similar works are still different, since Duchamp’s title, and the history of its production, alters what we think about his piece.

6. Definitions of Art

Up to the “de-definition” period, definitions of art fell broadly into three types, relating to representation, expression, and form. The dominance of representation as a central concept in art lasted from before Plato’s time to around the end of the eighteenth century. Of course, representational art is still to be found to this day, but it is no longer pre-eminent in the way it once was. Plato first formulated the idea by saying that art is mimesis, and, for instance, Bateaux in the eighteenth century followed him, when saying: “Poetry exists only by imitation. It is the same thing with painting, dance and music; nothing is real in their works, everything is imagined, painted, copied, artificial. It is what makes their essential character as opposed to nature.”

In the same century and the following one, with the advent of Romanticism, the concept of expression became more prominent. Even around Plato’s time, his pupil Aristotle preferred an expression theory: art as catharsis of the emotions. And Burke, Hutcheson, and Hume also promoted the idea that what was crucial in art were audience responses: pleasure in Art was a matter of taste and sentiment. But the full flowering of the theory of Expression, in the twentieth century, has shown that this is only one side of the picture.

In the taxonomy of art terms Scruton provided, Response theories concentrate on affective qualities such as “moving,” “exciting,” “nauseous,” “tedious,” and so forth. But theories of art may be called “expression theories” even though they focus on the embodied, emotional, and mental qualities discussed before, like “joyful,” “melancholy,” “humble,” “vulgar,” and “intelligent.” As we shall see below, when recent studies of expression are covered in more detail, it has been writers like John Hospers and O.K. Bouwsma who have preferred such theories. But there are other types of theory which might, even more appropriately, be called “expression theories.” What an artist is personally expressing is the focus of self-expression theories of art, but more universal themes are often expressed by individuals, and art-historical theories see the artist as merely the channel for broader social concerns.

R. G. Collingwood in the 1930s took art to be a matter of self-expression: “By creating for ourselves an imaginary experience or activity, we express our emotions; and this is what we call art.” And the noteworthy feature of Marx’s theory of art, in the nineteenth century, and those of the many different Marxists who followed him into the twentieth century, was that they were expression theories in the “art-Historical” sense. The arts were taken, by people of this persuasion, to be part of the superstructure of society, whose forms were determined by the economic base, and so art came to be seen as expressing, or “reflecting” those material conditions. Social theories of art, however, need not be based on materialism. One of the major social theorists of the late nineteenth century was the novelist Leo Tolstoy, who had a more spiritual point of view. He said: “Art is a human activity consisting in this, that one man consciously, by means of certain external signs, hands on to others feelings he has lived through, and that others are infected by these feelings and also experience them.”

Coming into the twentieth century, the main focus shifted towards abstraction and the appreciation of form. The aesthetic, and the arts and crafts movements, in the latter part of the nineteenth century drew people towards the appropriate qualities. The central concepts in aesthetics are here the pure aesthetic ones mentioned before, like “graceful,” “elegant,” “exquisite,” “glorious,” and “nice.” But formalist qualities, such as organization, unity, and harmony, as well as variety and complexity, are closely related, as are technical judgments like “well-made,” “skilful,” and “professionally written.” The latter might be separated out as the focus of Craft theories of art, as in the idea of art as “Techne” in ancient Greece, but Formalist theories commonly focus on all of these qualities, and “aesthetes” generally find them all of central concern. Eduard Hanslick was a major late nineteenth century musical formalist; the Russian Formalists in the early years of the revolution, and the French Structuralists later, promoted the same interest in Literature. Clive Bell and Roger Fry, members of the influential Bloomsbury Group in the first decades of the twentieth century, were the most noted early promoters of this aspect of Visual art.

Bell’s famous “Aesthetic Hypothesis” was: “What quality is shared by all objects that provoke our aesthetic emotions? Only one answer seems possible— significant form. In each, lines and colors combined in a particular way; certain forms and relations of forms, stir our aesthetic emotions. These relations and combinations of lines and colors, these aesthetically moving forms, I call ‘Significant Form’; and ‘Significant Form’ is the one quality common to all works of visual art.” Clement Greenberg, in the years of the Abstract Expressionists, from the 1940s to the 1970s, also defended a version of this Formalism.

Abstraction was a major drive in early twentieth century art, but the later decades largely abandoned the idea of any tight definition of art. The “de-definition” of art was formulated in academic philosophy by Morris Weitz, who derived his views from some work of Wittgenstein on the notion of games. Wittgenstein claimed that there is nothing which all games have in common, and so the historical development of them has come about through an analogical process of generation, from paradigmatic examples merely by way of “family resemblances.”

There are, however, ways of providing a kind of definition of art which respects its open texture. The Institutional definition of art, formulated by George Dickie, is in this class: “a work of art is an artefact which has had conferred upon it the status of candidate for appreciation by the artworld.” This leaves the content of art open, since it is left up to museum directors, festival organizers, and so forth, to decide what is presented. Also, as we saw before, Dickie left the notion of “appreciation” open, since he allowed that all aspects of a work of art could be attended to aesthetically. But the notion of “artefact,” too, in this definition is not as restricted as it might seem, since anything brought into an art space as a candidate for appreciation becomes thereby “artefactualized,” according to Dickie— and so he allowed as art what are otherwise called (natural) "Found Objects," and (previously manufactured) "Readymades." Less emphasis on power brokers was found in Monroe Beardsley’s slightly earlier aesthetic definition of art: “an artwork is something produced with the intention of giving it the capacity to satisfy the aesthetic interest”— where “production” and “aesthetic” have their normal, restricted content. But this suggests that these two contemporary definitions, like the others, merely reflect the historical way that art developed in the associated period. Certainly traditional objective aesthetic standards, in the earlier twentieth century, have largely given way to free choices in all manner of things by the mandarins of the public art world more recently.

7. Expression

Response theories of art were particularly popular during the Logical Positivist period in philosophy, that is, around the 1920s and 1930s. Science was then contrasted sharply with Poetry, for instance, the former being supposedly concerned with our rational mind, the latter with our irrational emotions. Thus the noted English critic I. A. Richards tested responses to poems scientifically in an attempt to judge their value, and unsurprisingly found no uniformity. Out of this kind of study comes the common idea that “art is all subjective”: if one concentrates on whether people do or do not like a particular work of art then, naturally, there can easily seem to be no reason to it.

We are now more used to thinking that the emotions are rational, partly because we now distinguish the cause of an emotion from its target. If one looks at what emotions are caused by an artwork, not all of these need target the artwork itself, but instead what is merely associated with it. So what the subjective approach centrally overlooks are questions to do with attention, relevance, and understanding. With those as controlling features we get a basis for normalizing the expected audience’s emotions in connection with the artwork, and so move away from purely personal judgments such as “Well, it saddened me” to more universal assessments like “it was sad.”

And with the “it” more focused on the artwork we also start to see the significance of the objective emotional features it metaphorically possesses, which were what Embodiment theorists like Hospers settled on as central. Hospers, following Bouwsma, claimed that the sadness of some music, for instance, concerns not what is evoked in us, nor any feeling experienced by the composer, but simply its physiognomic similarity to humans when sad: “it will be slow not tripping; it will be low not tinkling. People who are sad move more slowly, and when they speak they speak softly and low.” This was also a point of view developed at length by the gestalt psychologist Rudolph Arnheim.

The discriminations do not stop there, however. Guy Sircello, against Hospers, pointed out first that there are two ways emotions may be embodied in artworks: because of their form (which is what Hospers chiefly had in mind), and because of their content. Thus, a picture may be sad not because of its mood or color, but because its subject matter or topic is pathetic or miserable. That point was only a prelude, however, to an even more radical criticism of Embodiment theories by Sircello. For emotion words can also be applied, he said, on account of the “artistic acts” performed by the artists in presenting their attitude to their subject. If we look upon an artwork from this perspective, we are seeing it as a “symptom” in Suzanne Langer’s terms; however, Langer believed one should see it as a “symbol” holding some meaning which can be communicated to others.

Communication theorists all combine the three elements above, namely the audience, the artwork, and the artist, but they come in a variety of stamps. Thus, while Clive Bell and Roger Fry were Formalists, they were also Communication Theorists. They supposed that an artwork transmitted “aesthetic emotion” from the artist to the audience on account of its “significant form.” Leo Tolstoi was also a communication theorist but of almost the opposite sort. What had to be transmitted, for Tolstoi, was expressly what was excluded by Bell and (to a lesser extent) Fry, namely the “emotions of life.” Tolstoi wanted art to serve a moral purpose: helping to bind communities together in their fellowship and common humanity under God. Bell and Fry saw no such social purpose in art, and related to this difference were their opposing views regarding the value of aesthetic properties and pleasure. These were anathema to Tolstoi, who, like Plato, thought they led to waste; but the “exalted” feelings coming from the appreciation of pure form were celebrated by Bell and Fry, since their “metaphysical hypothesis” claimed it put one in touch with “ultimate reality.” Bell said, “What is that which is left when we have stripped a thing of all sensations, of all its significance as a means? What but that which philosophers used to call ‘the thing in itself’ and now call ‘ultimate reality’.”

This debate between moralists and aesthetes continues to this day with, for instance, Noël Carroll supporting a “Moderate Moralism” while Anderson and Dean support “Moderate Autonomism.” Autonomism wants aesthetic value to be isolated from ethical value, whereas Moralism sees them as more intimately related.

Communication theorists generally compare art to a form of Language. Langer was less interested than the above theorists in legislating what may be communicated, and was instead concerned to discriminate different art languages, and the differences between art languages generally and verbal languages. She said, in brief, that art conveyed emotions of various kinds, while verbal language conveyed thoughts, which was a point made by Tolstoy too. But Langer spelled out the matter in far finer detail. Thus, she held that art languages were “presentational” forms of expression, while verbal languages were “discursive”— with Poetry, an art form using verbal language, combining both aspects, of course. Somewhat like Hospers and Bouwsma, Langer said that art forms presented feelings because they were “morphologically similar” to them: an artwork, she held, shared the same form as the feeling it symbolizes. This gave rise to the main differences between presentational and discursive modes of communication: verbal languages had a vocabulary, a syntax, determinate meanings, and the possibility of translation, but none of these were guaranteed for art languages, according to Langer. Art languages revealed “what it is like” to experience something— they created “virtual experiences.”

The detailed ways in which this arises with different art forms Langer explained in her 1953 book Feeling and Form. Scruton followed Langer in several ways, notably by remarking that the experience of each art form is sui generis, that is, “each of its own kind.” He also spelled out the characteristics of a symbol in even more detail. Discussions of questions specific to each art form have been pursued by many other writers; see, for instance, Dickie, Sclafani, and Roblin, and the recent book by Gordon Graham.

8. Representation

Like the concept of Expression, the concept of Representation has been very thoroughly examined since the professionalization of Philosophy in the twentieth century.

Isn’t representation just a matter of copying? If representation could be understood simply in terms of copying, that would require “the innocent eye,” that is, one which did not incorporate any interpretation. E. H. Gombrich was the first to point out that modes of representation are, by contrast, conventional, and therefore have a cultural, socio-historical base. Thus perspective, which one might view as merely mechanical, is only a recent way of representing space, and many photographs distort what we take to be reality— for instance, those from the ground of tall buildings, which seem to make them incline inwards at the top.

Goodman, too, recognized that depiction was conventional; he likened it to denotation, that is, the relation between a word and what it stands for. He also gave a more conclusive argument against copying being the basis of representation. For that would make resemblance a type of representation, whereas if a resembles b, then b resembles a— yet a dog does not represent its picture. In other words, Goodman is saying that resemblance implies a symmetric relationship, but representation does not. As a result, Goodman made the point that representation is not a craft but an art: we create pictures of things, achieving a view of those things by representing them as this or as that. As a result, while one sees the objects depicted, the artist’s thoughts about those objects may also be discerned, as with Sircello’s “artistic arts.” The plain idea that just objects are represented in a picture was behind Richard Wollheim’s account of representational art in the first edition of his book Art and Its Objects (1968). There, the paint in a picture was said to be “seen as” an object. But in the book’s second edition, Wollheim augmented this account to allow for what is also “seen in” the work, which includes such things as the thoughts of the artist.

There are philosophical questions of another kind, however, with respect to the representation of objects, because of the problematic nature of fictions. There are three broad categories of object which might be represented: individuals which exist, like Napoleon; types of thing which exist, like kangaroos; and things which do not exist, like Mr. Pickwick, and unicorns. Goodman’s account of representation easily allowed for the first two categories, since, if depictions are like names, the first two categories of painting compare, respectively, with the relations between the proper name “Napoleon” and the person Napoleon, and the common name “kangaroo” and the various kangaroos. Some philosophers would think that the third category was as easily accommodated, but Goodman, being an Empiricist (and so concerned with the extensional world), was only prepared to countenance existent objects. So for him pictures of fictions did not denote or represent anything; instead, they were just patterns of various sorts. Pictures of unicorns were just shapes, for Goodman, which meant that he saw the description “picture of a unicorn” as unarticulated into parts. What he preferred to call a “unicorn-picture” was merely a design with certain named shapes within it. One needs to allow there are “intensional” objects as well as extensional ones before one can construe “picture of a unicorn’ as parallel to “picture of a kangaroo.” By contrast with Goodman, Scruton is one philosopher more happy with this kind of construal. It is a construal generally more congenial to Idealists, and to Realists of various persuasions, than to Empiricists.

The contrast between Empiricists and other types of philosopher also bears on other central matters to do with fictions. Is a fictional story a lie about this world, or a truth about some other? Only if one believes there are other worlds, in some kind of way, will one be able to see much beyond untruths in stories. A Realist will settle for there being “fictional characters,” often enough, about which we know there are some determinate truths— wasn’t Mr. Pickwick fat? But one difficulty then is knowing things about Mr. Pickwick other than what Dickens tells us— was Mr. Pickwick fond of grapes, for instance? An Idealist will be more prepared to consider fictions as just creatures of our imaginations. This style of analysis has been particularly prominent recently, with Scruton essaying a general theory of the imagination in which statements like “Mr. Pickwick was fat” are entertained in an “unasserted” fashion. One problem with this style of analysis is explaining how we can have emotional relations with, and responses to, fictional entities. We noticed this kind of problem before, in Burke’s description “delightful horror”: how can audiences get pleasure from tragedies and horror stories when, if those same events were encountered in real life, they would surely be anything but pleasurable? On the other hand, unless we believe that fictions are real, how can we, for instance, be moved by the fate of Anna Karenina? Colin Radford, in 1975, wrote a celebrated paper on this matter which concluded that the “paradox of emotional response to fiction” was unsolvable: adult emotional responses to fictions were “brute facts,” but they were still incoherent and irrational, he said. Radford defended this conclusion in a series of further papers in what became an extensive debate. Kendall Walton, in his 1990 book Mimesis and Make-Believe, pursued at length an Idealist’s answer to Radford. At a play, for instance, Walton said the audience enters into a form of pretence with the actors, not believing, but making believe that the portrayed events and emotions are real.

9. Art Objects

What kind of thing is a work of art? Goodman, Wollheim, Wolterstorff, and Margolis have been notable contributors to the contemporary debate.

We must first distinguish the artwork from its notation or “recipe,” and from its various physical realizations. Examples would be: some music, its score, and its performances; a drama, its script, and its performances; an etching, its plate, and its prints; and a photograph, its negative, and its positives. The notations here are “digital” in the first two cases, and “analogue” in the second two, since they involve discrete elements like notes and words in the one case, and continuous elements like lines and color patches in the other. Realizations can also be divided into two broad types, as these same examples illustrate: there are those that arise in time (performance works) and those that arise in space (object works). Realizations are always physical entities. Sometimes there is only one realization, as with architect-designed houses, couturier-designed dresses, and many paintings, and Wollheim concluded that in these cases the artwork is entirely physical, consisting of that one, unique realization. However, a number a copies were commonly made of paintings in the middle ages, and it is theoretically possible to replicate even expensive clothing and houses.

Philosophical questions in this area arise mainly with respect to the ontological status of the idea which gets executed. Wollheim brought in Charles Peirce’s distinction between types and tokens, as an answer to this: the number of different tokens of letters (7), and different types of letter (5), in the string “ABACDEC,” indicates the difference. Realizations are tokens, but ideas are types, that is, categories of objects. There is a normative connection between them as Margolis and Nicholas Wolterstorff have explained, since the execution of ideas is an essentially social enterprise.

That also explains how the need for a notation arises: one which would link not only the idea with its execution, but also the various functionaries. Broadly, there are the creative persons who generate the ideas, which are transmitted by means of a recipe to manufacturers who generate the material objects and performances. “Types are created, particulars are made” it has been said, but the link is through the recipe. Schematically, two main figures are associated with the production of many artworks: the architect and the builder, the couturier and the dressmaker, the composer and the performer, the choreographer and the dancer, the script-writer and the actor, and so forth. But a much fuller list of operatives is usually involved, as is very evident with the production of films, and other similar large entertainments. Sometimes the director of a film is concerned to control all its aspects, when we get the notion of an “auteur” who can be said to be the author of the work, but normally, creativity and craft thread through the whole production process, since even those designated “originators” still work within certain traditions, and no recipe can limit entirely the end product.

The associated philosophical question concerns the nature of any creativity. There is not much mystery about the making of particulars from some recipe, but much more needs to be said about the process of originating some new idea. For creation is not just a matter of getting into an excited mental state— as in a “brainstorming” session, for instance. That is a central part of the “creative process theory,” a form of which is to be found in the work of Collingwood. It was in these terms that Collingwood distinguished the artist from the craftsperson, namely with reference to what the artist was capable of generating just in his or her mind. But the major difficulty with this kind of theory is that any novelty has to be judged externally in terms of the artist’s social place amongst other workers in the field, as Jack Glickman has shown. Certainly, if it is to be an original idea, the artist cannot know beforehand what the outcome of the creative process will be. But others might have had the same idea before, and if the outcome was known already, then the idea thought up was not original in the appropriate sense. Thus the artist will not be credited with ownership in such cases. Creation is not a process, but a public achievement: it is a matter of breaking the tape ahead of others in a certain race.

10. References and Further Reading

  • Arnheim, R.1954, Art and Visual Perception. University of California Press, Berkeley.
    • A study of physiognomic properties from the viewpoint of gestalt psychology.
  • Beardsley, M.C. 1958, Aesthetics, Harcourt Brace, New York.
    • The classic mid-twentieth century text, with a detailed, practical study of the principles of art criticism.
  • Bell, C. 1914, Art, Chatto and Windus, London.
    • Manifesto for Formalism defending both his Aesthetic Hypothesis, and his Metaphysical Hypothesis.
  • Best, D. 1976, Philosophy and Human Movement, Allen and Unwin, London.
    • Applies aesthetic principles to Sport, and assesses its differences from Art.
  • Bourdieu, P. 1984, Distinction, trans. R.Nice, Routledge and Kegan Paul, London.
    • Studies contemporary French taste empirically, with special attention to the place of the “disinterested” class.
  • Carroll, N 1990, The Philosophy of Horror; or, Paradoxes of the Heart, Routledge, London and New York.
    • Investigation into the form and aesthetics of horror film and fiction, including discussion of the paradox of emotional response to fiction and the paradox of “horror-pleasure”.
  • Collingwood, R.G. 1958, The Principles of Art, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
    • Argues for important theses about Creativity, Art versus Craft, and Self-Expression.
  • Cooper, D. E. (ed.) 1995, A Companion to Aesthetics, Blackwell, Oxford.
    • Short notes about many aspects of, and individuals in Art and aesthetic theory.
  • Crawford, D.W. 1974, Kant’s Aesthetic Theory, University of Wisconsin Press, Madison.
    • Commentary on Kant’s third critique.
  • Curtler, H. (ed.) 1983, What is Art? Haven, New York.
    • Collects a number of papers discussing Beardsley’s aesthetics.
  • Danto, A. C. 1981, The Transfiguration of the Commonplace, Harvard University Press, Cambridge MA.
    • Contains Danto’s developed views about the influence of art theory.
  • Davies, S. 1991, Definitions of Art, Cornell University Press, Ithaca.
    • Contains a thorough study of the respective worth of Beardsley’s, and Dickie’s recent definitions of art.
  • Dickie, G. 1974, Art and the Aesthetic: An Institutional Analysis, Cornell University Press, Ithaca.
    • Dickie’s first book on his definition of Art.
  • Dickie, G. 1984, The Art Circle, Haven, New York.
    • Dickie’s later thoughts about his definition of Art.
  • Dickie, G. 1996, The Century of Taste, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
    • Contains a useful discussion of Hutcheson, Hume, and Kant, and some of their contemporaries.
  • Dickie, G., Sclafani, R.R., and Roblin, R. (eds) 1989, Aesthetics a Critical Anthology, 2nd ed. St Martin’s Press, New York.
    • Collection of papers on historic and contemporary Aesthetics, including ones on the individual arts.
  • Eagleton, T. 1990, The Ideology of the Aesthetic, Blackwell, Oxford.
    • A study of Aesthetics from the eighteenth century onwards, from the point of view of a Marxist, with particular attention to German thinkers.
  • Freeland, C. 2001, But Is it Art?, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
    • Discusses why innovation and controversy are valued in the arts, weaving together philosophy and art theory.
  • Gaut, B. and Lopes, D.M. (eds) 2001, The Routledge Companion to Aesthetics, Routledge, London and New York.
    • A series of short articles on most aspects of aesthetics, including discussions of the individual arts.
  • Gombrich, E.H. 1960, Art and Illusion, Pantheon Books, London.
    • Historical survey of techniques of pictorial representation, with philosophical commentary.
  • Goodman, N. 1968, Languages of Art, Bobbs-Merrill, Indianapolis.
    • Discusses the nature of notations, and the possibility of fakes.
  • Graham, G. 1997, Philosophy of the Arts; an Introduction to Aesthetics, Routledge, London.
    • Has separate chapters on Music, Painting and Film, Poetry and Literature, and Architecture.
  • Hanfling, O. (ed.) 1992, Philosophical Aesthetics, Blackwell, Oxford.
    • Summary papers on the core issues in Aesthetics, prepared for the Open University.
  • Hauser, A.1982, The Sociology of Art, Chicago University Press, Chicago.
    • Major historical study of Art’s place in society over the ages.
  • Hjort, M. and Laver, S. (eds) 1997, Emotion and the Arts, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
    • Papers on various aspects of art and emotion.
  • Hospers (ed) 1969, Introductory Readings in Aesthetics, Macmillan, New York.
    • Collection of major papers, including Stolnitz and Dickie on aesthetic attitudes, Hospers on Expression, and Bell, Fry, Langer and Beardsley about their various theories.
  • Hospers, J. (ed.) 1971, Artistic Expression, Appleton-Century-Crofts, New York.
    • Large collection of historical readings on Expression.
  • Kant, I. 1964, The Critique of Judgement, trans. J.C.Meredith, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
    • The original text of Kant’s third critique.
  • Iseminger, G. (ed.) 1992, Intention and Interpretation, Temple University Press, Philadelphia.
    • Contains papers by Hirsch, and Knapp and Michaels, amongst others, updating the debate over Intention.
  • Kelly, M. (ed.) 1998, Encyclopedia of Aesthetics, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
    • Four volumes not just on Philosophical Aesthetics, but also on historical, sociological, and biographical aspects of Art and Aesthetics worldwide.
  • Langer, S. 1953, Feeling and Form, Routledge and Kegan Paul, London.
    • Detailed study of the various art forms, and their different modes of expression.
  • Langer, S. 1957, Problems in Art, Routledge and Kegan Paul, London.
  • Langer, S. 1957, Philosophy in a New Key, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, MA.
    • Langer’s more theoretical writings.
  • Levinson, J. (ed.) 1998, Aesthetics and Ethics, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.
    • Contains papers by Carroll, and Anderson and Dean, amongst others, updating the debate over aestheticism.
  • Manns, J.W. 1998, Aesthetics, M.E.Sharpe, Armonk.
    • Recent monograph covering the main topics in the subject.
  • Margolis, J. (ed.) 1987, Philosophy Looks at the Arts, 3rd ed., Temple University Press, Philadelphia.
    • Central papers in recent Aesthetics, including many of the core readings discussed in the text.
  • Mothersill, M. 1984, Beauty Restored, Clarendon, Oxford.
    • Argues for a form of Aesthetic Realism, against Sibley, and with a discussion of Hume and Kant.
  • Richards, I. A. 1970, Poetries and Sciences, Routledge and Kegan Paul, London.
    • Defends a subjectivist view of Art.
  • Scruton, R.1974, Art and Imagination, Methuen, London.
    • A sophisticated and very detailed theory of most of the major concepts in Aesthetics.
  • Sheppard, A. D. R. 1987, Aesthetics: an Introduction to the Philosophy of Art, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
    • An introductory monograph on the whole subject.
  • Taylor, R. 1981, Beyond Art, Harvester, Brighton.
    • Defends the right of different classes to their own tastes.
  • Tolstoi, L. 1960, What is Art? Bobbs-Merrill, Indianapolis.
    • Tolstoi’s theory of Art and Aesthetics.
  • Walton, K.L. 1990, Mimesis as Make Believe, Harvard University Press, Cambridge MA.
    • A thorough view of many arts, motivated by the debate over emotional responses to fictions.
  • Wolff, J. 1993, Aesthetics and the Sociology of Art, 2nd ed., University of Michigan Press, Ann Arbor.
    • On the debate between objective aesthetic value, and sociological relativism.
  • Wollheim, R. 1980, Art and its Objects, 2nd ed. Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.
    • A philosophical study of the nature of art objects.
  • Wolterstorff, N. 1980, Works and Worlds of Art, Clarendon, Oxford.
    • A very comprehensive study.

Author Information

Barry Hartley Slater
University of Western Australia

Slavoj Zizek (1949—)

philosopher, portraitSlavoj Zizek is a Slovenian-born political philosopher and cultural critic. He was described by British literary theorist, Terry Eagleton, as the “most formidably brilliant” recent theorist to have emerged from Continental Europe.

Zizek’s work is infamously idiosyncratic. It features striking dialectical reversals of received common sense; a ubiquitous sense of humor; a patented disrespect towards the modern distinction between high and low culture; and the examination of examples taken from the most diverse cultural and political fields. Yet Zizek’s work, as he warns us, has a very serious philosophical content and intention. He challenges many of the founding assumptions of today’s left-liberal academy, including the elevation of difference or otherness to ends in themselves, the reading of the Western Enlightenment as implicitly totalitarian, and the pervasive skepticism towards any context-transcendent notions of truth or the good.

One feature of Zizek’s work is its singular philosophical and political reconsideration of German idealism (Kant, Schelling and Hegel). Zizek has also reinvigorated the challenging psychoanalytic theory of Jacques Lacan, controversially reading him as a thinker who carries forward founding modernist commitments to the Cartesian subject and the liberating potential of self-reflective agency, if not self-transparency. Zizek’s works since 1997 have become more and more explicitly political, contesting the widespread consensus that we live in a post-ideological or post-political world, and defending the possibility of lasting changes to the new world order of globalization, the end of history, or the war on terror.

This article explains Zizek’s philosophy as a systematic, if unusually presented, whole; and it clarifies the technical language Zizek uses, which he takes from Lacanian psychoanalysis, Marxism, and German idealism. In line with how Zizek presents his own work, this article starts by examining Zizek’s descriptive political philosophy. It then examines the Lacanian-Hegelian ontology that underlies Zizek’s political philosophy. The final part addresses Zizek’s practical philosophy, and the ethical philosophy he draws from this ontology.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Zizek’s Political Philosophy
    1. Criticism of Ideology as “False Consciousness”
    2. Ideological Cynicism and Belief
    3. Jouissance as Political Factor
    4. The Reflective Logic of Ideological Judgments (or How the King is King)
    5. Sublime Objects of Ideology
  3. Zizek’s Fundamental Ontology
    1. The Fundamental Fantasy & the Split Law
    2. Excursus: Zizek’s Typology of Ideological Regimes
    3. Kettle Logic, or Desire and Theodicy
    4. Fantasy as the Fantasy of Origins
    5. Exemplification: the Fall and Radical Evil (Zizek’s Critique of Kant)
  4. From Ontology to Ethics – Zizek’s Reclaiming of the Subject
    1. Zizek’s Subject, Fantasy, and the Objet Petit a
    2. The Objet Petit a & the Virtuality of Reality
    3. Forced Choice & Ideological Tautologies
    4. The Substance is Subject, the Other Does Not Exist
    5. The Ethical Act Traversing the Fantasy
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Literature (Books By Zizek)
    2. Secondary Literature (Texts on Zizek)

1. Biography

Slavoj Zizek was born in 1949 in Ljubljana, Slovenia. He grew up in the comparative cultural freedom of the former Yugoslavia’s self managing socialism. Here – significantly for his work – Zizek was exposed to the films, popular culture and theory of the noncommunist West. Zizek completed his PhD at Ljubljana in 1981 on German Idealism, and between 1981 and 1985 studied in Paris under Jacques AlainMiller, Lacan’s son-in-law. In this period, Zizek wrote a second dissertation, a Lacanian reading of Hegel, Marx and Kripke. In the late 1980s, Zizek returned to Slovenia where he wrote newspaper columns for the Slovenian weekly “Mladina”, and cofounded the Slovenian Liberal Democratic Party. In 1990, he ran for a seat on the fourmember collective Slovenian presidency, narrowly missing office. Zizek’s first published book in English The Sublime Object of Ideology appeared in 1989. Since then, Zizek has published over a dozen books, edited several collections, published numerous philosophical and political articles, and maintained a tireless speaking schedule. His earlier works are of the type “Introductions to Lacan through popular culture / Hitchcock / Hollywood …” Since at least 1997, however, Zizek’s work has taken on an increasingly engaged political tenor, culminating in recent books on September 11 and the recent Iraq war. As well as being visiting professor at the Department of Psychoanalysis, Universite ParisVIII in 19823 and 19856, Zizek has lectured at the Cardozo Law School, Columbia, Princeton, the New School for Social Research, the University of Michigan, Ann Arbor, and Georgetown. He is currently a returning faculty member of the European Graduate School, and founder and president of the Society for Theoretical Psychoanalysis, Ljubljana.

2. Zizek’s Political Philosophy

a. Criticism of Ideology as “False Consciousness”

In a way that is oddly reminiscent of Nietzsche, Zizek generally presents his work in a polemical fashion, knowingly striking out against the grain of accepted opinion. One untimely feature of Zizek’s work is his continuing defence and use of the unfashionable term “ideology”. According to the classical Marxist definition, ideologies are discourses that promote false ideas (or “false consciousness”) in subjects about the political regimes they live in. Nevertheless, because these ideas are believed by the subjects to be true, they assist in the reproduction of the existing status quo, in an exact instance of what Umberto Eco dubs “the force of the fake”. To critique ideology, according to this position, it is sufficient to unearth the truth(s) the ideologies conceal from the subject’s knowledge. Then, so the theory runs, subjects will become aware of the political shortcomings of their current regimes, and be able and moved to better them. As Zizek takes up in his earlier works, this classical Marxian notion of ideology has come under theoretical attack in a number of ways. First, to criticise a discourse as ideological implies access to a Truth about political things the Truth that the ideologies, as false, would conceal. But it is now widely disputed in the humanities that there could ever be any One such theoretically accessible Truth. Secondly, the notion of ideology is held to be irrelevant to describe contemporary sociopolitical life, because of the increased importance of what Jurgen Habermas calls “mediasteered subsystems” (the market, public and private bureaucracies), and also because of the widespread cynicism of today’s subjects towards political authorities. For ideologies to have political importance, critics comment, subjects would have to have a level of faith in public institutions, ideals and politicians which today’s liberalcosmopolitan subjects lack. The widespread notoriety of leftleaning authors like Michael Moore of Naom Chomsky, as one example, bears witness to how subjects today can know very well what Moore claims is the “awful truth”, and yet act as if they did not know.

Zizek agrees with critics about this “false consciousness” model of ideology. Yet he insists that we are not living in a postideological world, as figures as different as Tony Blair, Daniel Bell or Richard Rorty have claimed. Zizek proposes instead that in order to understand today’s politics we need a different notion of ideology. In a typically bold reversal, Zizek’s position is that today’s widespread consensus that our world is postideological gives voice to what he calls the “archideological” fantasy. Since “ideology” since Marx has carried a pejorative sense, no one who taken in by such an ideology has ever believed that they were so duped, Zizek comments. If the term “ideology” has any meaning at all, ideological positions are always what people impute to Others (for today’s left, for example, the political right are the dupes of one or another noble lie about natural community; for the right, the left are the dupes of well meaning but utopian egalitarianism bound to lead to economic and moral collapse, etc.). For subjects to believe in an ideology, it must have been presented to them, and been accepted, as nonideological indeed, as True and Right, and what anyone sensible would believe. As we shall see in 2e, Zizek is alert to the realist insight that there is no more effective political gesture than to declare some contestable matter above political contestation. Just as the third way is said to be postideological or national security is claimed to be extrapolitical, so Zizek argues that ideologies are always presented by their proponents as being discourses about Things too sacred to profane by politics. Hence, Zizek’s bold opening in The Sublime Object of Ideology is to claim that today ideology has not so much disappeared from the political landscape as come into its own. It is exactly because of this success, Zizek argues, that ideology has also been able to be dismissed in accepted political and theoretical opinion.

b. Ideological Cynicism and Belief

Today’s typical first world subjects, according to Zizek, are the dupes of what he calls “ideological cynicism”. Drawing on the German political theorist Sloterditj, Zizek contends that the formula describing the operation of ideology today is not “they do not know it, but they are doing it”, as it was for Marx. It is “they know it, but they are doing it anyway”. If this looks like nonsense from the classical Marxist perspective, Zizek’s position is that nevertheless this cynicism indicates the deeper efficacy of political ideology per se. Ideologies, as political discourses, are there to secure the voluntary consent – or what La Boetie called servitude voluntaire of people about contestable political policies or arrangements. Yet, Zizek argues, subjects will only voluntarily agree to follow one or other such arrangement if they believe that, in doing so, they are expressing their free subjectivity, and might have done otherwise.

However false such a sense of freedom is, Zizek insists that it is nevertheless a political instance of what Hegel called an essential appearance. Althusser’s understanding of ideological identification suggests that an individual is wholly “interpellated” into a place within a political system by the system’s dominant ideology and ideological state apparatuses. Contesting this notion by drawing on Lacanian psychoanalysis, however, Zizek argues that it is a mistake to think that, for a political position to win peoples’ support, it needs to effectively brainwash them into thoughtless automatons. Rather, Zizek maintains that any successful political ideology always allows subjects to have and to cherish a conscious distance towards its explicit ideals and prescriptions – or what he calls, in a further technical term, “ideological disidentification”.

Again bringing the psychoanalytic theory of Lacan to bear in political theory, Zizek argues that the attitude of subjects towards authority revealed by today’s ideological cynicism resembles the fetishist’s attitude towards his fetish. The fetishist’s attitude towards his fetish has the peculiar form of a disavowal: “I know well that (eg) the shoe is only a shoe, but nevertheless, I still need my partner to wear the shoe in order to enjoy”. According to Zizek, the attitude of political subjects towards political authority evinces the same logical form: “I know well that (for example) Bob Hawke / Bill Clinton / the Party / the market does not always act justly, but I still act as though I did not know that this is the case”. In Althusser’s famous “Ideology and Ideological State Apparatuses”, Althusser staged a kind of primal scene of ideology the moment when a policeman (as bearer of authority) says “hey you!” to an individual, and the individual recognises himself as the addressee of this call. In the “180 degree turn” of the individual towards this Other who has addressed him, the individual becomes a political subject, Althusser says. Zizek’s central technical notion of the “big O Other” closely resembles to the extent that it is not modelled on Althusser’s notion of the Subject (capital “S”) in the name of which public authorities (like the police) can legitimately call subjects to account within a regime for example, “God” in a theocracy, “the Party” under Stalinism, or “the People” in today’s China. As the central chapter of The Sublime Object of Ideology specifies, ideologies for Zizek work to identify individuals with such important or rallying political terms as these, which Zizek calls “master signifiers”. The strange but decisive thing about these pivotal political words, according to Zizek, is that no one knows exactly what they mean or refer to, or has ever seen with their own eyes the sacred objects which they seem to name (eg: God, the Nation, or the People). This is one reason why Zizek, in the technical language he inherits (via Lacan) from structuralism, says that the most important words in any political doctrine are “signifiers without a signified” (i.e. words which do not refer to any clear and distinct concept or demonstrable object).

This claim of Zizek’s is connected to two other central ideas in his work:

  • First: Zizek adapts the psychoanalytic notion that individuals are always “split” subjects, divided between the levels of their conscious awareness and the unconscious. Zizek contends throughout his work that subjects are always divided between what they consciously know and can say about political things, and a set of more or less unconscious beliefs they hold concerning individuals in authority, and the regime in which they live. (see 3a) Even if people cannot say clearly and distinctly why they support some political leader or policy, for Zizek no less than for Edmund Burke, this fact is not politically decisive, as we will see (see 2e below).
  • Second: Zizek makes a crucial distinction between knowledge and belief. Exactly where and because subjects do not know, for example, what “the essence” of “their people” is, the scope and nature of their beliefs on such matters is politically decisive, according to Zizek (again, see 2e below).

Zizek’s understanding of political belief is modelled on Lacan’s understanding of transference in psychoanalysis. The belief or “supposition” of the analysand in psychoanalysis is that the Other (his analyst) knows the meaning of his symptoms. This is obviously a false belief, at the start of the analytic process. But it is only through holding this false belief about the analyst that the work of analysis can proceed, and the transferential belief can become true (when the analyst does become able to interpret the symptoms). Zizek argues that this strange intersubjective or dialectical logic of belief in clinical psychoanalysis also characterises peoples’ political beliefs. Belief is always “belief through the Other”, Zizek argues. If subjects do not know the exact meaning of those “master signifiers” with which they political identify, this is because their political belief is mediated through their identifications with others. Although they each themselves “do not know what they do” (which is the title one of Zizek’s books [Zizek, 2002]), the deepest level of their belief is maintained through the belief that nevertheless there are Others who do know. A number of features of political life are cast into new relief given this psychoanalytic understanding, Zizek claims:

  • First, Zizek contends that the key political function of holders of public office is to occupy the place of what he calls, after Lacan, “the Other supposed to know”. Zizek cites the example of priests reciting mass in Latin before an uncomprehending laity, who believe that the priests know the meaning of the words, and for whom this is sufficient to keep the faith. Far from presenting an exception to the way political authority works, for Zizek this scenario reveals the universal rule of how political consensus is formed.
  • Second, and in connection with this, Zizek contends that political power is primarily “symbolic” in its nature. What he means by this further technical term is that the roles, masks, or mandates that public authorities bear is more important politically than the true “reality” of the individuals in question (whether they are unintelligent, unfaithful to their wives, good family women, etc.) According to Zizek, for example, fashionable liberal criticisms of George W. Bush the man are irrelevant to understanding or evaluating his political power. It is the office or place an individual occupies in their political system (or “Big Other”) that ensures the political force of their words, and the belief of subjects in their authority. This is why Zizek maintains that the resort of a political leader or regime to “the real of violence” (such as war or police action) amounts to a confession of its weakness as a political regime. Zizek sometimes puts this by thought saying that people believe through the big Other, or that the big Other believes for them, despite what they might inwardly think or cynically say.

c. Jouissance as Political Factor

A further key point that Zizek takes from Louis Althusser’s later work on ideology is Althusser’s emphasis on the “materiality” of ideology its embodiment in institutions and peoples’ everyday practices and lives. Zizek’s realist position is that all the ideas in the world can have no lasting political effect unless they come to inform institutions and subjects’ daytoday lives. In The Sublime Object of Ideology, Zizek cites Blaise Pascal’s advice that doubting subjects should get down on their knees and pray, and then they will believe. Pascal’s position is not any kind of simple protobehaviourism, according to Zizek. The deeper message of Pascal’s directive, he asserts, is to suggest that once subjects have come to believe through praying, they will also retrospectively see that they got down on their knees because they always believed, without knowing it. In this way, in fact, Zizek can be read as a consistent critic not only of the importance of knowledge in the formation of political consensus, but also of the importance of “inwardness” in politics per se in the tradition of the younger Carl Schmitt.

Prior political philosophy has placed too little emphasis, Zizek asserts (whether rightly or wrongly) on communities’ cultural practices that involve what he calls “inherent transgression”. These are practices sanctioned by a culture that nevertheless allow subjects some experience of what is usually exceptional to or prohibited in their everyday lives as civilised political subjects – things like sex, death, defecation, or violence. Such experiences involve what Zizek calls jouissance, another technical term he takes from Lacanian psychoanalysis. Jouissance is usually translated from the French as “enjoyment”. As opposed to what we talk of in English as “pleasure”, though, jouissance is an alwayssexualised, alwaystransgressive enjoyment, at the limits of what subjects can experience or talk about in public. Zizek argues that subjects’ experiences of the events and practices wherein their political culture organises its specific relations to jouissance (in first world nations, for example, specific sports, types of alcohol or drugs, music, festivals, films) are as close as they will get to knowing the deeper Truth intimated for them by their regime’s master signifiers – “nation”, “God”, “our way of life”, etc (see b above). Zizek, like Burke, argues that it is such ostensibly nonpolitical and culturally specific practices as these that irreplaceably single out any political community from its others and enemies. Or, as one of Zizek’s chapter titles in Tarrying With the Negative puts it, where and although subjects do not know their Nation, they “enjoy (jouis) their nation as themselves”.

d. The Reflective Logic of Ideological Judgments (or How the King is King)

According to Zizek, like and after Althusser, ideologies are thus political discourses whose primary function is not to make correct theoretical statements about political reality (as Marx’s “false consciousness” model implies), but to orient subjects’ lived relations to and within this reality. If a political ideology’s descriptive propositions turn out to be true (eg: “capitalism exploits the workers”, “Saddam was a dictator”, “the Spanish are the national enemy”, etc.), this does not in any way reduce their ideological character, in Zizek’s estimation. This is because this character concerns the political issue of how subjects’ belief in these propositions instead of those of opponents positions subjects on the leading political issues of the day. For Zizek, political speech is primarily about securing a lived sense of unity or community between subjects something like what Kant called sensus communis or Rousseau the general will. If political propositions seemingly do describe things in the world, Zizek’s position is that we nevertheless need always to understand them as Marx understood the exchangevalue of commodities – as “a relation between people being concealed behind a relation between things”. Or again: just as Kant thought that the proposition “this is beautiful” really expresses a subject’s reflective sense of commonality with all other subjects capable of being similarly affected by the object, so Zizek argues that propositions like “Go Spain!” or “the King will never stop working to secure our future” are what Kant called reflective judgments, which tell us as much or more about the subject’s lived relation to political reality as about this reality itself.

If ideological statements are thus performative utterances that produce political effects by their being stated, Zizek in fact holds that they are a strange species of performative utterance overlooked by speechact theory. Just because, when subjects say “the Queen is the Queen!”, they are at one level reaffirming their allegiance to a political regime, Zizek at the same time holds that this does not mean that this regime could survive without appearing to rest on such deeper Truths about the way the world is. As we saw in 2, b, Zizek maintains that political ideologies always present themselves as naming such deeper, extrapolitical Truths. Ideological judgments, according to Zizek, are thus performative utterances which, in order to perform their salutary political work, must yet appear to be objective descriptions of the way the world is (exactly as when a chairman says “this meeting is closed!”, only thereby bringing this state of affairs into effect). In Sublime Object of Ideology, Zizek cites Marx’s analysis of being a King in Das Capital to illustrate his meaning. A King is only King because his subjects loyally think and act like he is King think of the tragedy of Lear. Yet, at the same time, the people will only believe he is King if they believe that this is a deeper Truth about which they can do nothing.

e. Sublime Objects of Ideology

In line with Zizek’s ideas of “ideological disidentification” and “jouissance as a political factor” (see 2b and 2c above) and in a clear comparison with Derrida’s deconstruction arguably the unifying thought in Zizek’s political philosophy is that regimes can only secure a sense of collective identity if their governing ideologies afford subjects an understanding of how their regime relates to what exceeds, supplements or challenges its identity. This is why Kant’s analytic of the sublime in The Critique of Judgment, as an analysis of an experience in which the subject’s identity is challenged, is of the highest theoretical interest for Zizek. Kant’s analytic of the sublime isolates two moments to its experience, as Zizek observes. In the first moment, the size or force of an object painfully impresses upon the subject the limitation of its perceptual capabilities. In a second moment, however, a “representation” arises where “we would least expect it”, which takes as its object the subject’s own failure to perceptually take the object in. This representation resignifies the subject’s perceptual failure as indirect testimony about the inadequacy of human perception as such to attain to what Kant calls Ideas of Reason (in Kant’s system, God, the Universe as a Whole, Freedom, the Good).

According to Zizek, all successful political ideologies necessarily refer to and turn around sublime objects posited by political ideologies. These sublime objects are what political subjects take it that their regime’s ideologies’ central words mean or name extraordinary Things like God, the Fuhrer, the King, in whose name they will (if necessary) transgress ordinary moral laws and lay down their lives. When a subject believes in a political ideology, as we saw in b above, Zizek argues that this does not mean that they know the Truth about the objects which its key terms seemingly name – indeed, Zizek will finally contest that such a Truth exists. (see 3c, d) Nevertheless, by drawing on a parallel with Kant on the sublime, Zizek makes a further and more radical point. Just as in the experience of the sublime, Kant’s subject resignifies its failure to grasp the sublime object as indirect testimony to a wholly “supersensible” faculty within herself (Reason), so Zizek argues that the inability of subjects to explain the nature of what they believe in politically does not indicate any disloyalty or abnormality. What political ideologies do, precisely, is provide subjects with a way of seeing the world according to which such an inability can appear as testimony to how just how Transcendent or Great their Nation, God, Freedom, etc. is – surely far above the ordinary or profane things of the world. In Zizek’s Lacanian terms, these things are Real (capital “R”) Things (capital “T”), precisely insofar as they in this way stand out from the reality of ordinary things and events.

In the struggle of competing political ideologies, Zizek hence agrees with Ernesto Laclau and Chantale Mouffe, the aim of each is to elevate their particular political perspective (about what is just, best, etc.) to the point where it can lay claim to name, give voice to or to represent the political whole (eg: the nation). In order to achieve this political feat, Zizek argues, each group must succeed in identifying its perspective with the extrapolitical, sublime objects accepted within the culture as giving body to this whole (eg: “the national interest”, “the dictatorship of the proletariat”, etc.). Or else, it must supplant the previous ideologies’ sublime objects with new such objects. In the absolute monarchies, as Ernst Kantorowicz argued, the King’s socalled “second” or “symbolic” body exemplified paradigmatically such sublime political objects as the unquestionable font of political authority (the particular individual who was King was contestable, but not the sovereign’s role itself). Zizek’s critique of Stalinism, in a comparable way, turns upon the thought that “the Party” had this sublime political status in Stalinist ideology. Class struggle in this society did not end, Zizek contends, despite Stalinist propaganda. It was only displaced from a struggle between two classes (for example, bourgeois versus proletarian) to one between “the Party” as representative of the people or the whole and all who disagreed with it, ideologically positioned as “traitors” or “enemies of the people.”

3. Zizek’s Fundamental Ontology

a. The Fundamental Fantasy & the Split Law

For Zizek, as we have seen, no political regime can sustain the political consensus upon which it depends, unless its predominant ideology affords subjects a sense both of individual distance or freedom with regard to its explicit prescriptions (2b), and that the regime is grounded in some larger or “sublime” Truth (2e). Zizek’s political philosophy identifies interconnected instances of these dialectical ideas: his notion of “ideological disidentification” (2b); his contention that ideologies must accommodate subjects’ transgressive experiences of jouissance (2c); and his conception of exceptional or sublime objects of ideology (2e). Arguably the central notion in Zizek’s political philosophy intersects with these ideas Zizek’s notion of “ideological fantasy”. “Ideological fantasy” is Zizek’s technical name for the deepest framework of belief that structures how political subjects, and/or a political community, comes to terms with what exceeds its norms and boundaries, in the various registers we examined above.

Like many of Zizek’s key notions, Zizek’s notion of the ideological fantasy is a political adaptation of an idea from Lacanian psychoanalysis: specifically, Lacan’s structuralist rereading of Freud’s psychoanalytic understanding of unconscious fantasy. As for Lacan, so for Zizek, the civilising of subjects necessitates their founding sacrifice (or “castration”) of jouissance, enacted in the name of sociopolitical Law. Subjects, to the extent that they are civilised, are “cut” from the primal object of their desire. Instead, they are forced by social Law to pursue this special, lost Thing in Zizek’s technical term, the “objet petit a” (see 4a, 4b) by observing their societies’ linguistically mediated conventions, deferring satisfaction, and accepting sexual and generational difference. Subjects’ “fundamental fantasies”, according to Lacan, are unconscious structures which allow them to accept the traumatic loss involved in this founding sacrifice. They turn around a narrative about the lost object, and how it was lost. (see 3d) In particular, the fundamental fantasy of a subject resignifies the founding repression of jouissance by Law which according to Lacan is necessary if the individual is to become a speaking subject as if it were a merely contingent, avoidable occurrence. In the fantasy, that is, what is for Zizek a constitutive event for the subject is renarrated as the historical action of some exceptional individual (in Enjoy Your Symptom! the preOedipal “anal father”). Equally, the jouissance the subject considers itself to have lost is posited by the fantasy as having been taken from it by this persecutory “Other supposed to enjoy” what the subject takes himself to have lost. (see 3b)

In the notion of ideological fantasy, Zizek takes this psychoanalytic framework and applies it to the understanding of the constitution of political groups. If after Plato, political theory concerns the Laws of a regime, the Laws for Zizek are always split or double in kind. Each political regime has a body of more or less explicit, usually written Laws which demand that subjects forego jouissance in the name of the greater good, and according to the letter of its proscriptions (for example, the US or French constitutions). Zizek identifies this level of the Law with the Freudian ego ideal. But Zizek argues that, in order to be effective, a regime’s explicit Laws must also harbour and conceal a darker underside a set of more or less unspoken rules which, far from simply repressing jouissance, implicate subjects in a guilty enjoyment in repression itself, which Zizek likens to the “pleasureinpain” associated with the experience of Kant’s sublime. (see 2d) The Freudian superego, for Zizek, names the psychical agency of the Law, as it is misrepresented and sustained by subjects’ fantasmatic imaginings of a persecutory Other supposed to enjoy (like the archetypal villain in noir films). This darker underside of the Law, Zizek agrees with Lacan, is at its base a constant imperative to subjects to jouis!, by engaging in the “inherent transgressions” of their sociopolitical community (see 2b).

Zizek’s notion of the split in the Law in this way intersects directly with his notion of ideological disidentification examined in 2b. While political subjects maintain a conscious sense of freedom from the explicit norms of their culture, Zizek contends, this disidentification is grounded in their unconscious attachment to the Law as superego, itself an agency of enjoyment. If Althusser famously denied the importance of what people “have on their consciences” in the explanation of how political ideologies work, then, for Zizek the role of guilt – as the way in which the subject enjoys his subjection to the laws is vital to understanding subjects’ political commitments. Individuals will only turn around when the Law hails them, Zizek argues, insofar as they are finally subjects also of the unconscious belief that the “big O Other” has access to the jouissance they have lost as subjects of the Law, and which they can accordingly reattain through their political allegiance. (see 2b) It is this belief and so what could be termed this “political economy of jouissance” that the fundamental fantasies underlying political regimes’ worldviews are there to structure in subjects.

b. Excursus: Zizek’s Typology of Ideological Regimes

With these terms of Zizek’s Lacanian ontology in place, it becomes possible to lay out Zizek’s theoretical understanding of the differences between different types of ideologicalpolitical regimes. Zizek’s works maintain a lasting distinction between modern and premodern political regimes, which he contends are grounded in fundamentally different ways of organising subjects’ relations to Law and jouissance. (3a) In Zizek’s Lacanian terms, premodern ideological regimes exemplified what Lacan calls in Seminar XVII the discourse of the master. In these authoritarian regimes, the word and will of the King or master (in Zizek’s mathemes, S1) was sovereign – the source of political authority, with no questions asked. Her/His subjects, in turn, are supposed to know (S2) the edicts of the sovereign and the Law (as the classical legal notion has it, “ignorance is no excuse”). In this arrangement, while jouissance and fantasy are political factors, as Zizek argues, regimes’ quasitransgressive practices remain exceptional to the political arena, glimpsed only in such carnivalesque events as festivals or the types of public punishment Michel Foucault (for example) describes in the Introduction to Discipline and Punish.

Zizek agrees with both Foucault and Marx that modern political regimes exert a form of power that is both less visible and more farreaching than that of the regimes they replaced. Modern regimes both liberalcapitalist or totalitarian for Zizek, are no longer predominantly characterised by the Lacanian discourse of the master. Given that the Oedipal complex is associated by him with this older type of political authority, Zizek agrees with the Frankfurt School theorists that contra Deleuze and Guattari – today’s subjectivity as such is already post or antiOedipal. Indeed, in Plague of Fantasies and The Ticklish Subject, Zizek contends that the characteristic discontents of today’s political world from religious fundamentalism to the resurgence of racism in the first world – are not archaic remnants of, or protests against traditional authoritarian structures, but the pathological effects of new forms of social organisation. For Zizek, the defining agency in modern political regimes is knowledge (or, in his Lacanian mathemes, S2). The enlightenment represented the unprecedented political venture to replace belief in authority as the basis of polity with human reason and knowledge. As Schmitt also complained, the legitimacy of modern authorities is grounded not in the selfgrounding decision of the sovereign. It is grounded in the ability of authorities to muster coherent chains of reasons to subjects about why they are fit to govern. Modern regimes hence always claim to speak not out of ignorance of what subjects deeply enjoy “I don’t care what you want; just do what I say!” but in the very name of subjects’ freedom and enjoyment.

Whether fascist or communist, Zizek argues in his early books that totalitarian – versus authoritarian regimes justified their rule by final reference to quasiscientific metanarratives. These metanarratives – a narrative concerning racial struggle in Nazism, or the Laws of History in Stalinism – each claimed to know the deeper Truth about what subjects want, and accordingly could both justify the most striking transgressions of ordinary morality, and justify these transgressions by reference to subjects’ jouissance. The most disturbing or perverse features of these regimes can only be explained by reference to the key place of knowledge in these regimes, Zizek argues for instance, the truly Catch 22esque logic of the Soviet show trials, wherein it was not enough for subjects to be condemned by the authorities as enemies, but they were made to avow their “objective” error in opposing the party as agent of the laws of history.

Zizek’s statements on today’s liberalcapitalism are complex, if they are not in mutual tension. At times, Zizek tries to formalise the economic generation of surplus value as a meaningfully “hysterical” social arrangement. Yet Zizek predominantly argues that the marketdriven consumerism of later capitalist subjects is characterised by a marketing discourse which – like totalitarian ideologies does not appeal to subjects in the name of any collective cause justifying individuals’ sacrifice of jouissance. Instead, as social conservatives criticise, it musters the quasiscientific discourses of marketing and public relations, or (increasingly) Eastern religion, in order to recommend products to subjects as necessary means in the liberal pursuit of happiness and selffulfilment. In line with this change, Zizek contends in The Ticklish Subject that the paradigmatic type of leader today is not some inaccessible boss but the uncannily familiar figure of Bill Gates – more like a little brother than the traditional father or master. Again: for Zizek it is deeply telling that, at the same time as the nuclear family is being eroded in the first world, other institutions from the socalled “nanny” welfare state to private corporations are increasingly becoming “familiarised” (with selfhelp sessions for employees, company days, casual days, and so forth).

c. Kettle Logic, or Desire and Theodicy

We saw in 2 above how Zizek claims that the truth of political ideologies concerns what they do, not what they say. (2d) At the level of what political ideologies say, Zizek maintains, a Lacanian critical theory maintains that ideologies must be finally inconsistent. Freud famously talked of the example of a man who returns a borrowed kettle back to its owner broken. The man adduces mutually inconsistent excuses which are united only in terms of his ignoble desire, which is to evade responsibility for breaking the kettle he never borrowed the kettle, the kettle was already broken when he borrowed it, and when he gave the kettle back it was not really broken anyway. As Zizek reads political ideologies, they function in the same way in the political field – this is the sense of the subtitle of his 2004 Iraq: The Borrowed Kettle. As we saw in 2d, Zizek maintains that the end of political ideologies is to secure and defend the idea of the polity as a wholly unified community. When political strife, uncertainty or division occur, political ideologies and the fundamental fantasies upon which they lean (3a) operate to resignify this political discontent so that the political ideal of community can be sustained, and to deny the possibility that this discontent might signal a fundamental injustice or flaw within the regime. In what amounts to a kind of political theodicy, Zizek’s work point to a number of logically inconsistent – ideological responses to political discontents which are united only by the desire which informs them, like Freud’s “kettle logic”:

  1. saying that these divisions are politically unimportant, transient or merely apparent.
    Or, if this explanation fails:
  2. saying that the political divisions are in any case contingent to the ordinary run of events, so that if their cause is removed or destroyed, things will return to normal.
    Or, more perilously:
  3. saying that the divisions or problems are deserved by the people for the sake of the greater good (in Australia in the 90s, for example, we experienced “the recession we had to have”), or as punishment for their betrayal of the national Thing.

Zizek’s view of the political functioning of sublime objects of ideology can be charted exactly in terms of this political theodicy. (see 2e) We saw in 3a, how Zizek argues that subjects’ fantasy is what allows them to come to terms with the loss of jouissance fundamental to being social or political animals. Zizek centrally maintains that such narrative attempts at political selfunderstanding – whether of individuals or political regimes are ultimately unable to achieve these ends, except at the price of telling inconsistencies.

As Zizek highlights in his analyses of the political discontents in former Yugoslavia following the fall of communism, each national or political community tends to claim that its sublime Thing is inalienable, and hence utterly incapable of being understood or destroyed by enemies. Nevertheless, the invariable correlative of this emphasis on the inalienable nature of one’s Thing, Zizek argues in Tarrying With the Negative (1993), is the notion that It is simultaneously deeply fragile if not under active threat. For Zizek, this mutual inconsistency is only theoretically resolvable if, despite first appearances, we posit a materialist teaching that says that the “substance” seemingly named by political regimes’ key rallying terms (see 2e) is only sustained in their lived communal practices (as we say in Australia when someone does not get a joke, “you had to be there”). Yet political ideologies, as such, cannot avow this possibility. (see 2, d) Instead, ideological fantasies posit various exemplars of a persecutory enemy or as Zizek says, “the Other of the Other” to whom the explanation of political disunity or discontent can be traced. If only this other or enemy could be removed, the political fantasy contends, the regime would be fully equitable and just. Historical examples of such figures of the enemy include “the Jew” in Nazi ideology, or the “petty bourgeois” in Stalinism.

Again: a type of “kettle logic” applies to the way these enemies are represented in political ideologies, according to Zizek. “The Jew” in Nazi ideology, for example, was an inconsistent condensation of features of both the ruling capitalist class (moneygrabbing, exploitation of the poor) and of the proletariat (dirtiness, sexual promiscuity, communism). The only consistency this figure has, that is, is precisely as a condensation of everything that Nazi ideology’s Aryan volksgemeinschaft (roughly, “national community”) was constructed in response and political opposition to.

d. Fantasy as the Fantasy of Origins

In a way that has drawn some critics (Bellamy, Sharpe) to question how finally political Zizek’s political philosophy is, Zizek’s critique of ideology ultimately turns on a set of fundamental ontological propositions about the necessary limitations of any linguistic or symbolic system. These propositions concern the widelyknown paradoxes that bedevil any attempt by a semantic system to explain its own limits, and/or how it came into being. If what preceded the system was radically different from what subsequently emerged, how could the system have emerged from it, and how can the system come to terms with it at all? If we name the limits of what the system can understand, don’t we, in that very gesture, presuppose some knowledge of what is beyond these limits, if only enough to say what the system is not? The only manner in which we can explain the origin of language is within language, Zizek notes in For They Know Not What They Do. Yet we hence presuppose, again in the very act of the explanation, the very thing we were hoping to explain. Similarly, to take the example from political philosophy of Hobbes’ explanation of the origin of sociopolitical order the only way we can explain the origin of the social contract is by presupposing that Hobbes’ wholly presocial men nevertheless possessed in some way the very social abilities to communicate and make pacts that Hobbes’ position is supposed to explain.

For Zizek, fantasy as such is always fundamentally the fantasy of (one’s) origins. In Freud’s “Wolfman” case, to cite the psychoanalytic example Zizek cites in For They Know Not What They Do, the primal scene of parental coitus is the wolfman’s attempt to come to terms with his own origin – or to answer the infant’s perennial question “where did I come from?” The problem here is this: who could the spectacle of this primal scene have been staged for or seen by, if it really transpired before the genesis of the subject that it would explain? (see 3e, 4e) The only answer is that the wolfman has imaginatively transposed himself back into the primal scene if only as an impassive objectgaze – whose historical occurrence he had yet hoped would explain his origin as an individual.

Zizek’s argument is that, in the same way, political or ideological systems cannot and do not avoid deep inconsistencies. No less than Machiavelli, Zizek is acutely aware that the act that founds a body of Law is never itself legal, according to the very order of Law it sets in place. He cites Bertold Brecht, “what is the robbing of a bank, compared to the founding of a bank?” What fantasy does, in this register, is to try to historically renarrativise the founding political act as if it were or had been legal – an impossible application of the Law before the Law had itself come into being. No less than the wolfman’s false transposition of himself back into the primal scene that was to explain his origin, Zizek argues that the attempt of any political regime to explain its own origins in a political myth that denies the fundamental, extralegal violence of these origins is fundamentally false. (Zizek uses the example of the liberal myth of primitive accumulation to illustrate his position in For They Know Not What They Do, but we could cite here Plato’s myth of the reversed cosmos in the Laws and Statesman, or historical cases like the idea ofterra nullius in colonial Australia).

e. Exemplification: the Fall and Radical Evil (Zizek’s Critique of Kant)

In a series of places, Zizek situates his ontological position in terms of a striking reading of Immanuel Kant’s practical philosophy. Zizek argues that, in “Religion Within the Bounds of Reason Alone”, Kant showed that he was aware of these paradoxes that necessarily attend any attempt to narrate the origins of the Law. The JudaeoChristian myth of the fall succumbs to precisely these paradoxes, as Kant analyses – if Adam and Eve were purely innocent, how could they have been tempted?; if their temptation was wholly the fault of the tempter, why then has God punished humans with the weight of original sin?; but if Adam and Eve were not purely innocent when the snake lured them, in what sense was this a fall at all? According to Zizek, Kant’s text also provides us with theoretical parameters which allow us to explain and avoid these paradoxes. The problems for the mythical narrative, Kant argues, hail from its nature as a narrative – or how it tries to render in a historical story what he argues is truly a logical or transcendental priority. For Kant, human beings are – as such – radically evil. They have always already chosen to assert their own self conceit above the moral Law. This choice of radical evil, however, is not itself a historical choice either for individuals or for the species, for Kant. This choice is what underlies and opens up the space for all such historical choices. However, as Zizek argues, Kant withdraws from the strictly diabolical implications of this position. The key place in which this withdrawal is enacted is in the postulates of The Critique of Practical Reason, wherein Kant defends the immortality of the soul as a likely story, on the basis of our moral experience. Because of radical evil, Kant argues, it is impossible for humans to ever act purely out of duty in this life – this is what Kant thinks our irremovable sense of moral guilt attests. But because people can never act purely in this life, Kant suggests, it is surely reasonable to hope and even to postulate that the soul lives on after death, striving evercloser towards the perfection of its will.

Zizek’s contention is that this argument does not prove the immortality of a disembodied soul. It proves the immortality of an embodied individual soul, always struggling guiltily against its selfish corporeal impulses (this, incidentally, is one reason why Zizek argues, after Lacan, that de Sade is the truth of Kant). In order to make his proof even plausible, Zizek notes, Kant has to tacitly smuggle the spatiotemporal parameters of embodied earthly existence into the postulated hereafter so that the guilty subject can continue endlessly to struggle against his radically evil nature towards good. In this way, though, Kant himself has to speak as if he knew what things are like on the other side of death – which is to say, from the impossible, because impossibly neutral, perspective of someone able to impassively see the spectacle of the immortal subject striving guiltily towards the good. (see 4d) But in this way, also, Zizek argues that Kant enacts exactly the type of fantasmatic operation his reading of the fall (as a) narrative declaims, and which represents in nuce the basis operation also of all political ideologies.

4. From Ontology to Ethics – Zizek’s Reclaiming of the Subject

a. Zizek’s Subject, Fantasy, and the Objet Petit a

Perhaps Zizek’s most radical challenge to accepted theoretical opinion is his defence of the modern, Cartesian subject. Zizek knowingly and polemically positions his writings against virtually all other contemporary theorists, with the significant exception of Alain Badiou. But for Zizek, the Cartesian subject is not reducible to the fully selfassured “master and possessor of nature” of Descartes’Discourses. It is what Zizek calls in “Kant With (Or Against) Kant”, an outofjoint ontological excess orclinamen. Zizek takes his bearings here as elsewhere from a Lacanian reading of Kant, and the latter’s critique of Descartes’ cogito ergo sum. In the “Transcendental Dialectic” in The Critique of Pure Reason, Kant criticised Descartes’ argument that the selfguaranteeing “I think” of the cogito must be a thinking thing (res cogitans). For Kant (as for Zizek), while the “I think” must be capable of accompanying all of the subject’s perceptions, this does not mean that it is itself such a substantial object. The subject that sees objects in the world cannot see itself seeing, Zizek notes, any more than a person can jump over her own shadow. To the extent that a subject can reflectively see itself, it sees itself not as a subject but as one more represented object what Kant calls the “empirical self”, or what Zizek calls the “self” (versus the subject) in The Plague of Fantasies. The subject knows that it is something, Zizek argues. But it does not and can never know what Thing it is “in the Real”, as he puts it. (see 2e) This is why it must seek clues to its identity in its social and political life, asking the question of others (and the big O Other (see 2b)) which Zizek argues defines the subject as such: che voui? (what do you want from me?) In Tarrying With the Negative, Zizek hence reads the Director’s Cut of Ridley Scott’sBladerunner as revelatory of the Truth of the subject. Within this version of the film, as Zizek emphasises, the main character Deckard literally does not know what he is a robot that perceives itself to be human. According to Zizek, the subject is a “crack” in the universal field or substance of being, not a knowable thing. (see 4d) This is why Zizek repeatedly cites in his books the disturbing passage from the young Hegel describing the modern subject not as the “light” of the modern enlightenment, but “this night, this empty nothing …”

It is crucial to Zizek’s position, though, that Zizek denies the apparent implication of this that the subject is some kind of supersensible entity for example, an immaterial and immortal soul, etc. The subject is not a special type of Thing outside of the phenomenal reality we can experience, for Zizek. As we saw in 1, e above, such an idea would in fact reproduce in philosophy the type of thinking which he argues characterises political ideologies, and the subject’s fundamental fantasy. (see 3a) It is more like a fold or crease in the surface of this reality as Zizek puts it in Tarrying With the Negative, the point within the substance of reality wherein that substance is able to look at itself, and see itself as alien to itself. According to Zizek, Hegel and Lacan add to Kant’s reading of the subject as the empty “I think” that accompanies any individual’s experience the caveat that, because objects thus appear to a subject, they always appear in an incomplete or biased way. Zizek’s “formula” of the fundamental fantasy (see 2a, 2d) $ <> a tries to formalise exactly this thought. Its meaning is that the subject ($), in its fundamental fantasy, misrecognises itself as a special object (the objet petit a or lost object (see 2a)) within the field of objects that it perceives. In terms which unite this psychoanalytic notion with Zizek’s political philosophy, we can say that the objet petit a is, exactly, a sublime object. (2e) It is an object that is elevated or in Freudian terms, “sublimated” by the subject to the point where it stands as a metonymic representative of thejouissance the subject unconsciously fantasises was taken from her/him at castration. (3a) It hence functions as the objectcause of the subject’s desire that exceptional “little piece of the Real” that s/he seeks out in all of her/his love relationships. Its psychoanalytic paradigms are, to cite the title of a collection Zizek edited, “the voice and gaze as love objects”. Examples of the voice as object petit ainclude the persecutor’s voice in paranoia, or the very silence that some TV advertisements now use, and which captures our attention by making us wonder whether we may not have missed something. The preeminent Lacanian illustration of the gaze as object petit a is the anamorphotic skull at the foot of Holbein’s Ambassadors, which can only be seen by a subject who looks at it awry, or from an angle. Importantly, then, neither the voice nor the gaze as objet petit a attest to the subject’s sovereign ability to wholly objectify (and hence control) the world it surveys. In the auditory and visual fields (respectively), the voice and the gaze as objet petit a represent objects like Kant’s sublime things that the subject cannot wholly get its head around, as we say. The fact that they can only be seen or heard from particular perspectives indicates exactly how the subject’s biased perspective – and so his/her desire, what s/he wants – has an effect on what s/he is able to see. They thereby bear witness to how s/he is not wholly outside of the reality s/he sees. Even the most mundane but telling example of this subjective objet petit aof Lacanian theory is someone in love, of whom we commonly say that they are able to see in their lover something special an “X factor” which others are utterly blind to. In the political field, similarly – and as we saw in part 2c subjects of a particular political community will claim that others cannot understand their regime’s sublime objects. Indeed, as Zizek comments about the resurgence of racism across the first world today, it is often precisely the strangeness of others’ particular ethnic or national Things that animates subjects’ hatred towards them.

b. The Objet Petit a & the Virtuality of Reality

In Zizek’s theory, the objet petit a stands as the exact opposite of the object of the modern sciences, that can only be seen clearly and distinctly if it is approached wholly impersonally. If the objet petit a is not looked at from a particular, subjective perspective – or, in the words of one of Zizek’s titles, by “looking awry” it cannot be seen at all. This is why Zizek believes this psychoanalytic notion can be used to structure our understanding of the sublime objects postulated by ideologies in the political field, which as we saw in 3c show themselves to be finally inconsistent when they are looked at dispassionately. What Zizek’s Lacanian critique of ideology aims to do is to demonstrate such inconsistencies, and thereby to show us that the objects most central to our political beliefs are Things whose very sublime appearance conceals from us our active agency in constructing and sustaining them. (We will return to this thought in 4d and 4e below.)

Zizek argues that the first place that the objet petit a appeared in the history of Western philosophy was with Kant’s notion of the transcendental object in The Critique of Pure Reason. Analysing this Kantian notion allows us to elaborate more precisely the ontological status of the objet petit a. Kant defines the transcendental object as “the completely indeterminate thought of an object in general”. Like the objet petit a, then, Kant’s transcendental object is not a normal phenomenal object, although it has a very specific function in Kant’s epistemological conception of the subject. The avowedly antiHumean function of this Kantian positing in the “Transcendental Deduction” is to ensure that the purely formal categories of the subject’s understanding can actually affect and indeed structure the manifold of the subject’s sensuous intuition. As Zizek stresses, that is, the transcendental object functions in Kant’s epistemology to guarantee that sense will continue to emerge for the subject, no matter what particular objects s/he might encounter.

We saw in 3.c how Zizek argues that ideologies adduce ultimately inconsistent reasons to support the same goal of political unity. According to Zizek, as we can now elaborate, this is because the deepest political function of sublime objects of ideology is to ensure that the political world will make sense for subjects no matter what events transpire, in a way that he directly compares with Kant’s transcendental object. No matter what evidence someone might produce that all Jewish people are not acquisitive, capitalist, cunning …, for example, a true Nazi will be able to immediately resignify this evidence by reference to his ideological notion of “the Jew” “surely it is part of their cunning to appear as though they are not truly cunning”, etc. Importantly, it follows for Zizek that political community is always, in its very structure, an anticipated community. Subjects’ sense of political belonging is always mediated, according to him, by their shared belief in their regime’s key words or master signifiers. But these are words whose only “meaning” lies finally in their function, which is to guarantee that there will (continue to) be meaning. There is, Zizek argues, ultimately no actual, Real Thing better than the other real things subjects encounter that these words name. (2e) It is only by acting as if there were such a Thing that community is maintained. This is why Zizek specifies in The Indivisible Reminder that political identification can only be, “at its most basic, identification with the very gesture of identification”:

…the coordination [between subjects in a political community] concerns not the level of the signified [of some positive shared concern] but the level of the signifier. [In political ideologies], undecidability with regard to the signified (do others really intend the same as me?) converts into an exceptional signifier, the empty signifier, the empty master signifier, the signifier without signified; nation, democracy, socialism and other causes stand for that something about which we are not sure exactly what it is the point rather is that identifying with the nation we signal our acceptance of what others accept, with a master signifier which serves as the rallying point for all the others. [Zizek, 1996: 142]

This is the sense also in which Zizek claims in Plague of Fantasies that today’s virtual reality is “not virtual enough”. It is not virtual enough because the many options it offers subjects to enjoy (jouis) transgressive or exotic possibilities. VR leaves nothing to the imagination, or – in Zizek’s Lacanian terms – to fantasy. Fantasy, as we saw in 2a, operates to structure subjects’ beliefs about the jouissance which must remain only the stuff of imagination purely “virtual” for subjects of the social law. For Zizek, then, it is identification with this law, as mediated via subjects’ anticipatory identifications with what they suppose others believe that involves true virtuality.

c. Forced Choice & Ideological Tautologies

As 4b confirms (and as we commented in 1c), Zizek’s political philosophy turns around the idea that the central words of political ideologues are at base “signifiers without signified” words that only appear to refer to exceptional Things, and which thereby facilitate the identification between subjects. As Zizek argues, these sublime objects of ideology have exactly the ontological status of what Kant called “transcendental illusions” – illusions whose semblance conceals that there is nothing behind them to conceal. Ideological subjects do not know what they do when they believe in them, Zizek contends. Yet, through the presupposition that the Other(s) know (2c), and their participation in the practices involving inherent transgression of their political community (2c), they “identify with the very gesture of identification”. (4b) Hence, their belief, coupled with these practices, is politically efficient.

One of Zizek’s most difficult, but also deepest, claims is that the particular sublime objects of ideology with which subjects identify in different regimes (the Nation, the People, etc.) each give particular form to a metalaw (law about all other laws) that binds any political community as such. This is the metalaw that says simply that subjects must obey all the other laws. In 2b above, we saw how Zizek holds that political ideologies must allow subjects the sense of subjective distance from their explicit directives. Zizek’s critical position is that this apparent freedom ideologies thereby allow subjects is finally a lure. Like the choice offered Yossarian by the “catch 22” of Joseph Heller’s novel, the only option truly available to political subjects is to continue to abide by the laws. No regime can survive if it waives this metalaw. The Sublime Object of Ideology hence cites with approval Kafka’s comment that it is not required that subjects think the law is just, only that it is necessary. Yet no regime, despite Kafka, can directly avow its own basis in such naked selfassertion without risking the loss all legitimacy, Zizek agrees with Plato. This is why it must ground itself in ideological fantasies (3a) which at once sustain subjects’ sense of individual freedom (2c), and the sense that the regime itself is grounded extrapolitically in the Real, and some transcendent, higher Good. (2e)

This thought underlies the importance Zizek accords in For They Know Not What They Do to Hegel’s difficult notion of tautology as the highest instance of contradiction in The Science of Logic. If you push a subject hard enough about why they abide by the laws of their regime, Zizek holds that their responses will inevitably devolve into some logical variant of Exodus 3: 14’s “I am that I am” statements of the form “because the Law (God / the People/ the Nation) is … the Law (God / the People / the Nation)”. In such tautological statements, our expectation that the predicates in the second half of the sentence will add something new to the (logical) subject given at its beginning is “contradicted”, Hegel argues. There is indeed something even sinister when someone utters such a sentence in response to our enquiries, Zizek notes – as if, when (e.g.) “the Law” is repeated dumbly as its own predicate (“because the law is the law”), it intimates the uncanny dimension of jouissance the law as ego ideal usually proscribes. (3a) What this uncanny effect of sense attests to, Zizek argues in For They Know Not What They Do, is the usually “primordially repressed” force of the universal metalaw (that everyone must obey the laws) being expressed in the different, particular languages of political regimes “because the People are the People”, “because the Nation is the Nation”, etc.

Zizek’s ideology critique hence contends that all political regimes’ ideologies always devolve finally around a set of such tautological propositions concerning their particular sublime objects. In The Sublime Object of Ideology, Zizek gives the example of a key Stalinist proposition: “the people always supports the party”. On its surface, this proposition looks like a proposition that asserts something about the world, and which might be susceptible of disproof perhaps there are some Soviet citizens who do not support the party, or who disagree with this or that of the party’s policies. What such an approach misses, however, is how in this ideology, what is referred to as “the people” in fact means “all those who support the party”. In Stalinism, that is, “the party” is the fetishised particular that stands for the people’s true interests. (see 1e) Hence, the sentence “the people always support the party” is a concealed form of tautology”. Any apparent people who in fact do not support the party, by that fact alone are no longer “people”, within Stalinist ideology.

d. The Substance is Subject, the Other Does Not Exist

In 4b, we saw how Zizek argues that political identification is identification with the gesture of identification. In 4c, we saw how the ultimate foundation of a regimes’ laws is a tautologous assertion of the bare political fact that there is law. What unites these two positions is the idea that the sublime objects of a political regime and the ideological fantasies that give narratives about their content conceal from subjects the absence of any final ground for Law beyond the fact of its own assertion, and the fact that subjects take it to be authoritative. Here as elsewhere, Zizek’s work surprisingly approaches leadingmotifs in the political philosophy of Carl Schmitt.

Importantly, once this position is stated, we can also begin to see how Zizek’s postMarxist project of a critique of ideology intersects with his philosophical defence of the Cartesian subject. At several points in his oeuvre, Zizek cites Hegel’s statement in the “Introduction” to the Phenomenology of Spirit that “the substance is subject” as a rubric that describes the core of his own political philosophy. According to Zizek, critics have misread this statement by taking it to repeat the founding, triumphalist idea of modern subjectivity as such – namely, that the subject can master all of nature or “substance”. Zizek contends, controversially, that Hegel’s claim ought to be read in a directly opposing sense. For him, it indicates the truth that there can be no dominant political regime or, in Hegel’s terms, no “social substance” that does not depend for its authority upon the active, indeed finally anticipatory (4c) investment of subjects in it. Like the malign computermachines in The Matrix that literally run off the human jouissance they drain from deluded subjects, for Zizek the big Other of any political regime does not exist as a selfsustaining substance. It must ceaselessly run on the belief and actions of its subjects, and their jouissance (2c) – or, to recur to the example we looked at in 2d, the King will not be the King, for Zizek, unless he has his subjects. It is certainly telling that the leading examples of ideological tautology For They know What They Do discusses invoke precisely some subject’s will or decision as when a parent says to a child “do this … because I said so”, or when people do something “… because the King said so”, which means that no more questions can be asked.

In 4.a, we saw how Zizek denies that the subject, because it is not itself a perceptible object, belongs to an order of being wholly outside of the order of experience. To elevate such a wholly Other order would, he argues, reproduce the elementary operation of the fundamental fantasy. We can add to this thought now the further position that the Cartesian subject is, according to Zizek, is finally nothing other than the irreducible point of active agency responsible for the alwaysminimally precipitous political gesture of laying down a regime’s law. For Zizek, accordingly, the critical question to be asked of any theoretical or political position that posits some exceptional Beyond, as we saw in his reading of Kant (2e) is: from which subjectposition do you speak when you claim a knowledge of this Beyond? As we saw in 2e, Zizek’s Lacanian answer is that the perspective that one always presupposes when one speaks in this manner is one that is always “superegoic” (see 2a) – tied to what he terms in Metastases of Enjoyment a “malevolently neutral”, God’s eye view from nowhere. It is deeply revealing, from Zizek’s perspective, that the very perspective which allows the Kantian subject in the “dynamic sublime” to resignify its own finitude as itself a source of pleasureinpain (jouissance) is precisely one which identifies with the supersensible moral Law, before which the sensuous subject remains irredeemably guilty, infinitely striving to pay off its moral debt. As Zizek cites Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit:

…it is manifest that beyond the socalled curtain [of phenomena] which is supposed to conceal the inner world there is nothing to see unless we go behind it ourselves, as much in order that we may see, as that there may be something behind there which can be seen… (emphasis added)

In other words, Zizek’s final position about the sublime objects of political regimes’ ideologies is that these beliefinspiring objects are so many ways in which the subject misrecognises its own active capacity to challenge existing laws, and to found new laws altogether. Zizek repeatedly argues that the most uncanny or abyssal Thing in the world is the subject’s own active subjectivity – which is why he also repeatedly cites the Eastern saying that Thou Art That. It is finally the singularity of the subject’s own active agency that subjects misperceive in fantasies concerning the sublime objects of their regimes’ ideologies, in the face of which they can do nothing but reverentially abide by the rules. In this way, it is worth noting, Zizek’s work can claim a heritage not only of Hegel, but also from the Left Hegelians, and Marx’s and Feuerbach’s critiques of religion.

e. The Ethical Act Traversing the Fantasy

Zizek’s technical term for the process whereby we can come to recognise how the sublime objects of our political regimes’ ideologies are – like Marx’s commodities fetish objects that conceal from subjects their own political agency is “traversing of the fantasy”. Traversing the fantasy, for Zizek, is at once the political subject’s deepest form of selfrecognition, and the basis for his own radical political position or defence of the possibility of such positions. Zizek’s entire theoretical work directs us towards this “traversing of the fantasy”, in the many different fields on which he has written, and despite the widespread consensus at the beginning of the new century that fundamental political change is no longer possible or desirable.

Insofar as political ideologies for Zizek, like Althusser (see 2c), remain viable only because of the ongoing practices and belief of political subjects, this traversal of fantasy must always involve an active, practical intervention in the political world, which changes a regime’s political institutions. As for Kant, so for Zizek, the practical bearing of critical reason comes first, in his critique of ideology, and last, in his advocation of the possibility of political change. Zizek hence also repeatedly speaks of traversing the fantasy in terms of an “Act” (capital “A”), which differs from normal human speech and action. Everyday speech and action typically does not challenge the framing sociopolitical parameters within which it takes place, Zizek observes. By contrast, what he means by an Act (capital A) is an action which “touches the Real” (as he says) of what a sociopolitical regime has politically repressed or wiped its hands of, and which it cannot publicly avow without risking fundamental political damage. (see 2c) In this way, the Zizekian Act extends and changes the very political and ideological parameters of what is permitted within a regime, in the hope of bringing into being new parameters in the light of which its own justice will be able to be retrospectively seen. This is the point of significant parallel with Alain Badiou’s work, whose influence Zizek has increasingly avowed in his more recent books. Notably, as Zizek specifies in The Indivisible Remainder, the Act as what it is effectively repeats the very act that he claims founds all political regimes as such namely, the excessive, lawfounding gesture we examined in 4c. Just as the current political regime originated in a founding gesture excessive with regard to the laws it set in place, Zizek argues, so too can this political regime itself be superseded, and a new one replace it. In his reading of Walter Benjamin’s “Theses on the Philosophy of History” in The Sublime Object of Ideology, Zizek indeed argues that such a new Act also effectively repeats all previous, failed attempts at changing an existing political regime, which otherwise would be consigned forever to historical oblivion.

5. Conclusion

Slavoj Zizek’s work represents a striking challenge within the contemporary philosophical scene. Zizek’s very style, and his prodigious ability to write and examine examples from widely divergent field, is a remarkable thing. His work reintroduces and reinvigorates for a wider audience ideas from the work of German Idealism. Zizek’s work is framed in terms of a polemical critique of other leading theorists within today’s new left or liberal academy (Derrida, Habermas, Deleuze), which claims to unmask their apparent radicality as concealing a shared recoil from the possibility of a subjective, political Act which in fact sits comfortably with a passive resignation to today’s political status quo. Not the least interesting feature of his work, politically, is indeed how Zizek’s critique of the new left both significantly mirrors criticisms from conservative and neoconservative authors, yet hails from an avowedly opposed political perspective. In political philosophy, Zizek’s Lacanian theory of ideology presents a radically new descriptive perspective that affords us a unique purchase on many of the paradoxes of liberalconsumerist subjectivity, which is at once politically cynical (as the political right laments) and politically conformist (as the political left struggles to come to terms with). Prescriptively, Zizek’s work challenges us to ask questions about the possibility of sociopolitical change that have otherwise rarely been asked after 1989 – including: what forms such changes might take?; and what might justify them or make them possible?

Looked at in a longer perspective, it is of course too soon to judge what the lasting effects of Zizek’s philosophy will be, especially given Zizek’s own comparative youth as a thinker (Zizek was born in 1949). In terms of the history of ideas, in particular, while Zizek’s thought certainly turns on their heads many of today’s widely accepted theoretical notions, it is surely a more lasting question whether his work represents any more lasting a break with the parameters that Kant’s critical philosophy set out in the threeCritiques.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Literature (Books By Zizek)

  • Iraq The Borrowed Kettle, New York: Verso, 2004.
  • Organs Without Bodies: On Deleuze and Consequences, New York, London: Routledge, 2003.
  • The Puppet and the Dwarf, New York: Routledge, 2003.
  • Did Somebody Say Totalitarianism? Five Essays on the (Mis)Use of a Notion, London; New York: Verso, 2001.
  • The Fright of Real Tears, Kieslowski and The Future, Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2001.
  • On Belief, London: Routledge, 2001.
  • The Fragile Absolute or Why the Christian Legacy is Worth Fighting For, London; New York: Verso, 2000.
  • The Art of the Ridiculous Sublime, On David Lynch’s Lost Highway, Walter Chapin Center for the Humanities: University of Washington, 2000.
  • Contingency, Hegemony, Universality: Contemporary Dialogues on the Left, Judith Butler, Ernesto Laclau and SZ. London; New York: Verso, 2000.
  • Enjoy Your Symptom! Jacques Lacan in Hollywood and Out, second expanded edition, New York: Routledge, 2000.
  • The Ticklish Subject: The Absent Centre of Political Ontology, London; New York: Verso, 1999.
  • The Abyss Of Freedom Ages Of The World, with F.W.J. von Schelling, Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press, 1997.
  • The Plague of Fantasies, London; New York: Verso, 1997.
  • Gaze And Voice As Love Objects, Renata Salecl and SZ editors. Durham: Duke University Press, 1996.
  • The Indivisible Remainder: An Essay On Schelling And Related Matters, London; New York: Verso, 1996.
  • The Metastases Of Enjoyment: Six Essays On Woman And Causality (Wo Es War), London; New York: Verso, 1994.
  • Mapping Ideology, SZ editor. London; New York: Verso, 1994.
  • Tarrying With The Negative: Kant, Hegel And The Critique Of Ideology, Durham: Duke University Press, 1993.
  • Enjoy Your Symptom! Jacques Lacan In Hollywood And Out, London; New York: Routledge, 1992.
  • Everything You Always Wanted to Know About Lacan (But Were Afraid To Ask Hitchcock), SZ editor. London; New York: Verso, 1992.
  • Looking Awry: an Introduction to Jacques Lacan through Popular Culture, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, 1991.
  • For They Know Not What They Do: Enjoyment As A Political Factor, London; New York: Verso, 1991.
  • The Sublime Object of Ideology, London; New York: Verso, 1989.

b. Secondary Literature (Texts on Zizek)

  • Slavoj Zizek: A Little Piece of the Real, Matthew Sharpe, Hants: Ashgate, 2004.
  • Slavoj Zizek: A Critical Introduction, Ian Parker, London: Pluto Press, 2004.
  • Slavoj Zizek: Live Theory, Rex Butler, London: Continuum, 2004.
  • Zizek: A Critical Introduction, Sarah Kay, London: Polity, 2003.
  • Slavoj Zizek (Routledge Critical Thinkers), Tony Myers, London: Routledge, 2003.

Author Information

Matthew Sharpe


Punishment involves the deliberate infliction of suffering on a supposed or actual offender for an offense such as a moral or legal transgression. Since punishment involves inflicting a pain or deprivation similar to that which the perpetrator of a crime inflicts on his victim, it has generally been agreed that punishment requires moral as well as legal and political justification. While philosophers almost all agree that punishment is at least sometimes justifiable, they offer various accounts of how it is to be justified as well as what the infliction of punishment is designed to protect – rights, personal autonomy and private property, a political constitution, or the democratic process, for instance. Utilitarians attempt to justify punishment in terms of the balance of good over evil produced and thus focus our attention on extrinsic or consequentialist considerations. Retributivists attempt a justification that links punishment to moral wrongdoing, generally justifying the practice on the grounds that it gives to wrongdoers what they deserve; their focus is thus on the intrinsic wrongness of crime that thereby merits punishment. “Compromise” theorists attempt to combine these two types of theories in a way that retains their perceived strengths while overcoming their perceived weaknesses. After discussing the various attempts at justification, utilitarian and retributive approaches to determining the amount of punishment will be examined. Finally, the controversial issue of capital punishment will be briefly discussed.

Table of Contents

  1. Utilitarianism
    1. Utilitarian Justification
    2. Objection and Response
  2. Retributivism
    1. Retributive Justification
    2. Objection and Response
  3. Compromise Theories
    1. Hart’s Theory
    2. Objection and Response
  4. Amount of Punishment
    1. Utilitarians on Amount
    2. Retributivists on Amount
  5. Capital Punishment
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Utilitarianism

a. Utilitarian Justification

Utilitarianism is the moral theory that holds that the rightness or wrongness of an action is determined by the balance of good over evil that is produced by that action. Philosophers have argued over exactly how the resulting good and evil may be identified and to whom the greatest good should belong. Jeremy Bentham identified good with pleasure and evil with pain and held that the greatest pleasure should belong to the greatest number of people. John Stuart Mill, perhaps the most notable utilitarian, identified good with happiness and evil with unhappiness and also held that the greatest happiness should belong to the greatest number. This is how utilitarianism is most often discussed in the literature, so we will follow Mill in our discussion.

When attempting to determine whether a punishment is justifiable, utilitarians will attempt to anticipate the likely consequences of carrying out the punishment. If punishing an offender would most likely produce the greatest balance of happiness over unhappiness compared with the other available options (not taking any action, publicly denouncing the offender, etc.), then the punishment is justified. If another available option would produce a greater balance of happiness over unhappiness, then that option should be chosen and punishment is unjustified.

Clearly, crimes tend to produce unhappiness, so in seeking to promote a state of affairs in which the balance of happiness over unhappiness is maximized, a utilitarian will be highly concerned with reducing crime. Traditionally, utilitarians have focused on three ways in which punishment can reduce crime. First, the threat of punishment can deter potential offenders. If an individual is tempted to commit a certain crime, but he knows that it is against the law and a punishment is attached to a conviction for breaking that law, then, generally speaking, that potential offender will be less likely to commit the crime. Second, punishment can incapacitate offenders. If an offender is confined for a certain period of time, then that offender will be less able to harm others during that period of time. Third, punishment can rehabilitate offenders. Rehabilitation involves making strides to improve an offender’s character so that he will be less likely to re-offend.

Although utilitarians have traditionally focused on these three ways in which punishment can reduce crime, there are other ways in which a punishment can affect the balance of happiness over unhappiness. For example, whether or not a given offender is punished will affect how the society views the governmental institution that is charged with responding to violations of the law. The degree to which they believe this institution is functioning justly will clearly affect their happiness. Utilitarians are committed to taking into account every consequence of a given punishment insofar as it affects the balance of happiness over unhappiness.

b. Objection and Response

Perhaps the most common objection to the utilitarian justification of punishment is that its proponent is committed to punishing individuals in situations in which punishment would clearly be morally wrong. H.J. McCloskey offers the following example:

Suppose a utilitarian were visiting an area in which there was racial strife, and that, during his visit, a Negro rapes a white woman, and that race riots occur as a result of the crime, white mobs, with the connivance of the police, bashing and killing Negroes, etc. Suppose too that our utilitarian is in the area of the crime when it is committed such that his testimony would bring about the conviction of a particular Negro. If he knows that a quick arrest will stop the riots and lynchings, surely, as a utilitarian, he must conclude that he has a duty to bear false witness in order to bring about the punishment of an innocent person (127).

A utilitarian is committed to endorsing the act that would be most likely to produce the greatest balance of happiness over unhappiness, and, in this situation, it appears that the act that meets this criterion is bearing false witness against an innocent person. But, so the argument goes, it cannot be morally permissible, let alone morally mandatory, to perform an act that leads directly to the punishment of an innocent person. Therefore, since the utilitarian is committed to performing this clearly wrong act, the utilitarian justification must be incorrect.

The standard utilitarian response to this argument demands that we look more closely at the example. Once we do this, it supposedly becomes clear that the utilitarian is not committed to performing this clearly wrong act. In his reply to McCloskey’s argument, T.L.S. Sprigge states that if faced with the decision presented in the example, a “sensible utilitarian” will attach a great deal of weight to the near-certain fact that framing an innocent man would produce a great deal of misery for that man and his family. This consideration would receive such weight because “the prediction of misery… rests on well confirmed generalizations” (72). Furthermore, the sensible utilitarian will not attach much weight to the possibility that framing the man would stop the riots. This is because this prediction “will be based on a hunch about the character of the riots” (72). Since well confirmed generalizations are more reliable than hunches, happiness is most likely to be maximized when individuals give the vast majority of the weight to such well confirmed generalizations when making moral decisions. Therefore, since the relevant well confirmed generalization tells us that at least a few people (the innocent man and his family) would be made miserable by the false testimony, the utilitarian would give much weight to this consideration and choose not to bear false witness against an innocent man.

This type of response can in turn be challenged in various ways, but perhaps the best way to challenge it is to point out that even if it is true that the greatest balance of good over evil would not be promoted by punishing an innocent person in this situation, that is not the reason why punishing an innocent person would be wrong. It would be wrong because it would be unjust. The innocent man did not rape the woman, so he does not deserve to be punished for that crime. Because utilitarianism focuses solely on the balance of happiness over unhappiness that is produced by various actions, it is unable to take into account important factors such as justice and desert. If justice and desert cannot be incorporated into the theory, then the punishment of innocents cannot be ruled out as unjust, so a prohibition against it will have to be dependent upon the likelihood of various consequences. This strikes many theorists as problematic.

2. Retributivism

a. Retributive Justification

Regarding retributive theories, C.L. Ten states that, “There is no complete agreement about what sorts of theories are retributive except that all such theories try to establish an essential link between punishment and moral wrongdoing” (38). He is surely right about this, so, therefore, it is difficult to give a general account of retributive justification. However, it is possible to state certain features that characterize retributive theories generally. Concepts of desert and justice occupy a central place in most retributive theories: in accordance with the demands of justice, wrongdoers are thought to deserve to suffer, so punishment is justified on the grounds that it gives to wrongdoers what they deserve. It is instructive to look at the form that a particular retributive theory can take, so we will examine the views of Immanuel Kant.

Kant invokes what he refers to as the “principle of equality” in his discussion of punishment. If this principle is obeyed, then “the pointer of the scale of justice is made to incline no more to the one side than the other” (104). If a wrongful act is committed, then the person who has committed it has upset the balance of the scale of justice. He has inflicted suffering on another, and therefore rendered himself deserving of suffering. So in order to balance the scale of justice, it is necessary to inflict the deserved suffering on him. But it is not permissible to just inflict any type of suffering. Kant states that the act that the person has performed “is to be regarded as perpetrated on himself” (104). This he refers to as the “principle of retaliation”. Perhaps the most straightforward application of this principle demands that murderers receive the penalty of death. So, for Kant, the justification of punishment is derived from the principle of retaliation, which is grounded in the principle of equality.

The concepts of desert and justice play a central role in Kant’s theory, and they are applied in a way that rules out the possibility of justifying the punishment of innocents. Since an innocent person does not deserve to be punished, a Kantian is not committed to punishing an innocent person, and since it seems to some that utilitarians are committed to punishing innocents (or participating in the punishment of innocents) in certain circumstances, Kant’s theory may seem to be superior in this respect. Recall that the failure to take desert and justice into consideration is thought by many to be a major problem with utilitarian theory. However, while Kantian theory may seem superior because it takes desert and justice into account, an influential criticism of the theory challenges the idea that punishment can be justified on the grounds of justice and desert without requiring that the balance of happiness over unhappiness be taken into account.

b. Objection and Response

Gertrude Ezorsky argues that we should test the Kantian position and other retributive positions that resemble it “by imagining a world in which punishing criminals has no further effects worth achieving” (xviii). In this world, punishment does not deter or rehabilitate. For whatever reason, incapacitation is impossible. In addition, victims receive no satisfaction from the punishment of those who have harmed them. In this world, a Kantian would be committed to the position that punishments still ought to be inflicted upon wrongdoers. Furthermore, the individuals that populated this world would be morally obligated to punish wrongdoers. If they failed to punish wrongdoers, they would be failing to abide by the dictates of justice. But surely it is quite odd to hold that these individuals would be morally obligated to punish when doing so would not produce any positive effects for anyone. According to Ezorsky, this terribly odd consequence suggests that the Kantian theory is problematic.

Kant would not agree that this consequence of his theory is odd. According to Kant, “if justice and righteousness perish, human life would no longer have any value in the world” (104). So, even the inhabitants of our imaginary world are obliged to ensure that “every one may realize the desert of his deeds” (106). If they do not live up to this obligation, then they will be failing to abide by the dictates of justice, and their lives will be of lesser value. Of course, critics of the Kantian theory are unlikely to be persuaded by this response. Indeed, it is appropriate to be highly skeptical of a conception of justice that holds that justice can be promoted without anyone’s welfare being promoted.

As stated earlier, many of the theories that are referred to as “retributive” vary significantly from one another. However, as the Kantian theory possesses many central features that other retributive theories possess, criticisms similar to Ezorsky’s have been leveled against many of them. Predictably, the responses to these criticisms vary depending on the particular theory.

3. Compromise Theories

Many theorists have attempted to take features of utilitarianism and retributivism and combine them into a theory that retains the strengths of both while overcoming their weaknesses. The impetus for attempting to develop this sort of theory is clear: the idea that punishment should promote good consequences, such as the reduction of crime, surely seems attractive. However, the idea that it would be justified to punish an innocent in any circumstance where such punishment would be likely to promote the greatest balance of happiness over unhappiness surely seems wrong. Likewise, the idea that justice and the desert of the offender should play a central role in a justification of punishment is attractive, while being committed to punishing an offender even when nobody’s welfare would be promoted as a result seems to be problematic. So, each type of theory seems to have positive and negative aspects. But how to combine these seemingly opposed theories and produce a better one? Is a compromise between them really possible? In an attempt to explore this possibility, we will examine the theory of H.L.A. Hart.

a. Hart’s Theory

According to Hart, in order to clarify our thinking on the subject of punishment,

What is needed is the realization that different principles… are relevant at different points in any morally acceptable account of punishment. What we should look for are answers to a number of different questions such as: What justifies the general practice of punishment? To whom may punishment be applied? (3)

The failure to separate these questions from one another and consider that they might be answered by appealing to different principles has prevented many previous theorists from generating an acceptable account of punishment. Hart states that the first question (“What justifies the general practice of punishment?”) is a question of “General Justifying Aim” and ought to be answered by citing utilitarian concerns. The second (“To whom may punishment be applied?”) is a question of “Distribution” and ought to be answered by citing retributive concerns. So, the general practice is to be justified by citing the social consequences of punishment, the main social consequence being the reduction of crime, but we ought not be permitted to punish whenever inflicting a punishment is likely to reduce crime. In other words, we may not apply punishment indiscriminately. We may only punish “an offender for an offense” (9). With few exceptions, the individual upon whom punishment is inflicted must have committed an offense, and the punishment must be attached to that offense.

Hart’s theory attempts to avoid what may have appeared to be an impasse blocking the construction of an acceptable theory of punishment. Utilitarian concerns play a major role in his theory: the practice of punishment must promote the reduction of crime, or else it is not justifiable. But retributive concerns also play a major role: the range of acceptable practices that can be engaged in by those concerned with reducing crime is to be constrained by a retributive principle allowing only the punishment of an offender for an offense. Hart’s theory, at the very least, represents a plausible attempt at a “compromise” between those inclined towards utilitarianism and those inclined towards retributivism.

Hart does admit that on certain occasions the principle stating that we may only punish an offender for an offense (referred to as the principle of “retribution in Distribution”) may be overridden by utilitarian concerns. When the utilitarian case for punishing an innocent person is particularly compelling, it may be good for us to do so, but “we should do so with the sense of sacrificing an important principle” (12). Many people will agree with Hart that it may be necessary to punish an innocent person in extreme cases, and it is thought to be an advantage of his theory that it captures the sense that, in these cases, an important principle is being overridden.

b. Objection and Response

This overriding process, however, cannot work in the opposite direction. In Hart’s theory, some social good must be promoted or some social evil must be reduced in order for punishment to be justified. Because of this, it is unjustifiable to punish a person who seems to deserve punishment unless some utilitarian aim is being furthered. Imagine the most despicable character you can think of, a mass-murderer perhaps. The justifiability of punishing a person guilty of such crimes is beholden to the social consequences of the punishment. That a depraved character would suffer for his wrongdoing is not enough. So, for Hart, considerations of desert cannot override utilitarian considerations in this way. Some theorists find this consequence of his theory unacceptable. Ten argues that, “it would be unfair to punish an offender for a lesser offense and yet not punish another offender for a more serious offense” (80). If we are behaving in accordance with Hart’s theory, we may, on occasion, have to avoid punishing serious offenders while continuing to punish less serious offenders for utilitarian reasons. Since doing so would be unfair, it seems that Hart’s theory may be seriously flawed.

In order to assess Ten’s criticism, it is important to ask the following question: If we were to avoid punishing the more serious offender, to whom would we be being unfair? In an effort to answer this question, we must consider whether the offender who has committed the lesser crime has grounds for complaint if the more serious offender is not punished. By stipulation, the lesser offender committed the crime and cannot thereby claim a violation of justice on those grounds. Is the justification of his punishment contingent upon the punishment of others? Arguably not: The punishment of the lesser offender is justified regardless of whoever else is punished. He may bemoan his bad luck and wish that his punishment were not likely to further any utilitarian aims so that he may avoid it, but he cannot rightly accuse society of a violation of justice for failing to punish others when he does in fact deserve the punishment that is being inflicted upon him. The attractiveness of Ten’s argument is derived from the fact that its conclusion fits with our intuitions regarding the idea that some people just deserve to suffer no matter what. Perhaps we ought to reexamine that intuition and consider that it may be rooted in an urge to revenge, not a concern for justice.

4. Amount of Punishment

The belief that, in most cases, the amount of punishment should vary directly with the seriousness of the offense is widely accepted. However, utilitarians and retributivists have different ways of arriving at this general conclusion.

a. Utilitarians on Amount

Bentham, a utilitarian, states that, “The greater the mischief of the offence, the greater is the expense, which it may be worth while to be at, in the way of punishment” (181). Crime and punishment both tend to cause unhappiness. Recall that utilitarianism is solely concerned with the balance of happiness over unhappiness produced by an action. When attempting to determine the amount of punishment that ought to be permitted for a given offense, it is necessary to weigh the unhappiness that would be caused by the offense against the unhappiness caused by various punishments. The greater the unhappiness caused by a given offense, the greater the amount of punishment that may be inflicted for that offense in order to reduce its occurrence before the unhappiness caused by the punishment outweighs the unhappiness caused by the offense (Ten, 143).

So, utilitarians would often be committed to abiding by the rule that the amount of punishment should vary directly with the seriousness of the offense. However, it seems that there are cases in which they would be committed to violating this rule. Critics argue that utilitarians would sometimes be committed to inflicting a severe punishment for a relatively minor offense. Ten asks us to imagine a society in which there are many petty thefts and thieves are very difficult to catch. Since there are many thefts, the total amount of unhappiness caused by them is great. Imagine that one thief is caught and the authorities are deciding how severely to punish him. If these authorities were utilitarians, they would be committed to giving him a very severe sentence, 10 years perhaps, if this were the only way to deter a significant number of petty thieves. But surely making an example of the one thief who was unlucky or unskilled enough to be caught is unjust. Since utilitarians are sometimes committed to inflicting such harsh punishments for relatively minor offenses, their approach must be inadequate (143-144).

b. Retributivists on Amount

Retributivists argue that more serious offenses should be punished more severely because offenders who commit more serious crimes deserve harsher punishment than those who commit less serious crimes. Given our previous discussion of retributivism, it should not come as a surprise that the concept of desert plays a central role here. According to many classic versions of retributivism, including Kant’s, the deserved punishment is determined by invoking the lex talionis. The old adage, “An eye for an eye, a tooth for a tooth,” is derived from the lex talionis, which “requires imposing a harm on a criminal identical to the one he imposed on his victim” (Shafer-Landau, 773). Those who argue that murderers ought to be put to death have often invoked this principle, but it is rarely invoked when attempting to determine the proper punishment for other crimes. Its lack of popularity can be explained by noting a couple of objections. First, it is difficult to apply to many offenses, and it seems to be outright inapplicable to some. How should we punish the counterfeiter, the hijacker, or the childless kidnapper? Applying the lex talionis to these crimes is, at the very least, problematic. Second, there are many cases in which it would require that we punish offenders by performing actions that ought not to be carried out by any government (773). Surely we should not rape rapists! For these and other reasons, except when the topic at hand is capital punishment, appeals to the lex talionis in the contemporary literature are rare.

Many contemporary retributivists hold that the principle of proportionality should be used in order to determine the amount of punishment to be meted out in particular cases. This principle states that, “the amount of punishment should be proportionate to the moral seriousness or moral gravity of offenses…” (Ten, 154). Different versions of the proportionality principle call for different ways of establishing how severe a punishment must be in order to meet the demands set by the principle. Must it merely be the case that there be a direct relationship between the amount of punishment and the seriousness of the offense, or must offenders suffer the same amount as their victim(s) in order for the demands of the principle to be met? Retributivists are not in complete agreement on how to answer this question.

While retributivists seem to have an easier time ensuring that there be a direct relationship between the amount of punishment and the seriousness of the offense, their position is subject to criticism. Because they are committed to inflicting the deserved punishment, they must do so even when a lesser punishment would produce the same social effects. Clearly, this criticism runs parallel to the objection to retributivism discussed in section 2: if the retributivist is committed to inflicting the deserved punishment regardless of the social effects, then it seems that he is committed to inflicting gratuitous pain on an offender. Of course, some resist the idea that inflicting suffering in such a case would be gratuitous, which is why this debate continues. In any case, the perceived shortcomings of both the utilitarian and retributive approaches have led theorists to attempt to develop approaches that combine elements of both. For reasons similar to those cited in support of the aforementioned “compromise” theories, it seems that these approaches are the most promising.

5. Capital Punishment

Capital punishment involves the deliberate killing of a supposed or actual offender for an offense. Throughout history and across different societies, criminals have been executed for a variety of offenses, but much of the literature is devoted to examining whether those convicted of murder ought to be executed, and this discussion will be similarly focused.

A combination of utilitarian and retributive considerations are usually invoked in an effort to justify the execution of murderers. The centerpiece of most arguments in favor of capital punishment is retributive: Murderers deserve to be put to death. This is usually argued for along Kantian lines: By deliberately causing an innocent person’s death, the murderer has rendered himself deserving of death. Utilitarian considerations generally play a large role as well. Proponents argue that the threat of capital punishment can deter potential murderers. Since many human beings’ greatest fear is death, the intuitive plausibility of this claim is clear. In addition, proponents point to the fact that capital punishment is the ultimate incapacitation. Clearly, if a murderer is dead, then he can never harm anyone again.

Opponents of capital punishment challenge proponents on each of these points. Albert Camus denies that murder and capital punishment are equivalent to one another:

But what is capital punishment if not the most premeditated of murders, to which no criminal act, no matter how calculated, can be compared? If there were to be a real equivalence, the death penalty would have to be pronounced upon a criminal who had forewarned his victim of the very moment he would put him to a horrible death, and who, from that time on, had kept him confined at his own discretion for a period of months. It is not in private life that one meets such monsters (25).

This argument and others that resemble it are often put forth in an attempt to counter the retributive argument. Also, any criminal justice system that executes convicted criminals runs the risk of executing some individuals who do not deserve to be executed: the wrongfully convicted. Some argue that a fallible criminal justice system ought not to impose a penalty that removes the possibility of mistakes being rectified. The utilitarian arguments have also come under attack. Some argue that the proponents of capital punishment have overstated its deterrent value, and it has been argued that it may even incite some people to commit murder (Bedau, 198-200). Regarding incapacitation, it has been argued that the danger involved in failing to execute murderers has been similarly overstated (196-198).

6. Conclusion

These issues introducing punishment have received a great deal of attention in the professional literature, and many philosophers continue to discuss them and offer various answers to the questions that are raised. However, the issues raised here are not the only ones. There are many, including the role of excuses and mitigating circumstances, the usage of insanity as a defense, the imprisonment of offenders, and the cultural and historical context of punishment.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Beccaria, Cesare. On Crimes and Punishments. Trans. David Young. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1986.
  • Bedau, Hugo Adam. “Capital Punishment.” In Matters of Life and Death: New Introductory Essays in Moral Philosophy. Ed. Tom Regan. New York: Random House, 1986. 175-212.
  • Bedau, Hugo Adam, and Paul Cassell, eds. Debating the Death Penalty: Should America Have Capital Punishment? The Experts on Both Sides Make Their Best Case. New York: Oxford University Press, 2004.
  • Bentham, Jeremy. The Principles of Morals and Legislation. New York: Hafner Publishing Company, 1948.
  • Camus, Albert. Reflections on the Guillotine. Trans. Richard Howard. Michigan City, IN: Fridtjof-Karla Publications, 1959.
  • Duff, R.A. “Penal Communications: Recent Work in the Philosophy of Punishment.” Crime and Justice 20 (1996): 1-97.
  • Duff, R.A., and David Garland, eds. A Reader on Punishment. New York: Oxford University Press, 1994.
  • Ezorsky, Gertrude. “The Ethics of Punishment.” In Philosophical Perspectives on Punishment. Ed. Gertrude Ezorsky. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1972. xi-xxvii.
  • Foucault, Michel. Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison. Trans. Alan Sheridan. New York: Random House, 1977.
  • Hart, H.L.A. “Prolegomenon to the Principles of Punishment.” In Punishment and Responsibility: Essays in the Philosophy of Law. New York: Oxford University Press, 1968. 1-27.
  • Kant, Immanuel. “Justice and Punishment.” Trans. W. Hastie. In Philosophical Perspectives on Punishment. Ed. Gertrude Ezorsky. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1972. 102-106.
  • McCloskey, H.J. “A Non-Utilitarian Approach to Punishment.” In Philosophical Perspectives on Punishment. Ed. Gertrude Ezorsky. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1972. 119-134.
  • Mill, John Stuart. Utilitarianism. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1979. Shafer-Landau, Russ. “The Failure of Retributivism.” In Philosophy of Law. Ed. Joel Feinberg and Jules Coleman. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth/Thompson Learning, 2000. 769-779.
  • Sprigge, T.L.S. “A Utilitarian Reply to Dr. McCloskey.” In Philosophical Perspectives on Punishment. Ed. Gertrude Ezorsky. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1972. 66-79.
  • Ten, C.L. Crime, Guilt, and Punishment. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1987.

Author Information

Kevin Murtagh
John Jay College of Criminal Justice
U. S. A.

Hannah Arendt (1906—1975)


Hannah Arendt is a twentieth century political philosopher whose writings do not easily come together into a systematic philosophy that expounds and expands upon a single argument over a sequence of works. Instead, her thoughts span totalitarianism, revolution, the nature of freedom and the faculties of thought and judgment.

The question with which Arendt engages most frequently is the nature of politics and the political life, as distinct from other domains of human activity. Arendt's work, if it can be said to do any one thing, essentially undertakes a reconstruction of the nature of political existence. This pursuit takes shape as one that is decidedly phenomenological, a pointer to the profound influence exerted on her by Heidegger and Jaspers. Beginning with a phenomenological prioritization of the experiential character of human life and discarding traditional political philosophy's conceptual schema, Arendt in effect aims to make available the objective structures and characteristics of political being-in-the-world as a distinct mode of human experience. This investigation spans the rest of Arendt's life and works. During its course, recurrent themes emerge that help to organize her thought--themes such as the possibility and conditions of a humane and democratic public life, the forces that threaten such a life, conflict between private and public interests, and intensified cycles of production and consumption. As these issues reappear, Arendt elaborates on them and refines them, rarely relaxing the enquiry into the nature of political existence. The most famous facet of this enquiry, often considered also to be the most original, is Arendt's outline of the faculty of human judgment. Through this, she develops a basis upon which publicly-minded political judgment can survive, in spite of the calamitous events of the 20th century which she sees as having destroyed the traditional framework for such judgment.

The article proceeds by charting a roughly chronological map of her major works. It endeavours to illuminate the continuities and connections within these works in an attempt to synchronize them as a coherent but fully-functioning body of thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Chronology of Life and Works
  2. Arendt's Thought: Context and Influences
  3. On Totalitarianism
  4. The Human Condition
    1. The Vita Activa: Labor, Work and Action
      1. Labor: Humanity as Animal Laborans
      2. Work: Humanity as Homo Faber
      3. Action: Humanity as Zoon Politikon
  5. On Revolution
  6. Eichmann and the "Banality of Evil"
  7. Thinking and Judging
  8. Influence
  9. Criticisms and Controversies
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Major Works by Arendt
    2. Recommended Further Reading

1. Chronology of Life and Works

The political philosopher, Hannah Arendt (1906-1975), was born in Hanover, Germany, in 1906, the only child of secular Jews. During childhood, Arendt moved first to Königsberg (East Prussia) and later to Berlin. In 1922-23, Arendt began her studies (in classics and Christian theology) at the University of Berlin, and in 1924 entered Marburg University, where she studied philosophy with Martin Heidegger. In 1925 she began a romantic relationship with Heidegger, but broke this off the following year. She moved to Heidelberg to study with Karl Jaspers, the existentialist philosopher and friend of Heidegger. Under Jasper's supervision, she wrote her dissertation on the concept of love in St. Augustine's thought. She remained close to Jaspers throughout her life, although the influence of Heidegger's phenomenology was to prove the greater in its lasting influence upon Arendt's work.

In 1929, she met Gunther Stern, a young Jewish philosopher, with whom she became romantically involved, and subsequently married (1930). In 1929, her dissertation (Der Liebesbegriff bei Augustin) was published. In the subsequent years, she continued her involvement in Jewish and Zionist politics, which began from 1926 onwards. In 1933, fearing Nazi persecution, she fled to Paris, where she subsequently met and became friends with both Walter Benjamin and Raymond Aron. In 1936, she met Heinrich Blücher, a German political refugee, divorced Stern in '39, and the following year she and Blücher married in 1940.

After the outbreak of war, and following detention in a camp as an "enemy alien," Arendt and Blücher fled to the USA in 1941. Living in New York, Arendt wrote for the German language newspaper Aufbau and directed research for the Commission on European Jewish Cultural Reconstruction. In 1944, she began work on what would become her first major political book, The Origins of Totalitarianism. In 1946, she published "What is Existenz Philosophy," and from 1946 to 1951 she worked as an editor at Schoken Books in New York. In 1951, The Origins of Totalitarianism was published, after which she began the first in a sequence of visiting fellowships and professorial positions at American universities and she attained American citizenship.

In 1958, she published The Human Condition and Rahel Varnhagen: The Life of a Jewess. In 1959, she published "Reflections on Little Rock," her controversial consideration of the emergent Black civil rights movement. In 1961, she published Between Past and Future, and traveled to Jerusalem to cover the trial of Nazi Adolf Eichmann for the New Yorker.

In 1963 she published her controversial reflections on the Eichmann trial, first in the New Yorker, and then in book form as Eichmann in Jerusalem: A Report on the Banality of Evil. In this year, she also published On Revolution. In 1967, having held positions at Berkeley and Chicago, she took up a position at the New School for Social Research in New York. In 1968, she published Men in Dark Times.

In 1970, Blücher died. That same year, Arendt gave her seminar on Kant's philosophy of judgement at the New School (published posthumously as Reflections on Kant's Political Philosophy, 1982). In 1971 she published "Thinking and Moral Considerations," and the following year Crisis of the Republicappeared. In the next years, she worked on her projected three-volume work, The Life of the Mind. Volumes 1 and 2 (on "Thinking" and "Willing") were published posthumously. She died on December 4, 1975, having only just started work on the third and final volume, Judging.

2. Arendt's Thought: Context and Influences

Hannah Arendt is a most challenging figure for anyone wishing to understand the body of her work in political philosophy. She never wrote anything that would represent a systematic political philosophy, a philosophy in which a single central argument is expounded and expanded upon in a sequence of works. Rather, her writings cover many and diverse topics, spanning issues such as totalitarianism, revolution, the nature of freedom, the faculties of "thinking" and "judging," the history of political thought, and so on. A thinker of heterodox and complicated argumentation, Arendt's writings draw inspiration from Heidegger, Aristotle, Augustine, Kant, Nietzsche, Jaspers, and others. This complicated synthesis of theoretical elements is evinced in the apparent availability of her thought to a wide and divergent array of positions in political theory: for example, participatory democrats such as Benjamin Barber and Sheldon Wolin, communitarians such as Sandel and MacIntyre, intersubjectivist neo-Kantians such as Habermas, Albrecht Wellmer, Richard Bernstein and Seyla Benhabib, etc. However, it may still be possible to present her thought not as a collection of discrete interventions, but as a coherent body of work that takes a single question and a single methodological approach, which then informs a wide array of inquiries. The question, with which Arendt's thought engages, perhaps above all others, is that of the nature of politics and political life, as distinct from other domains of human activity. Her attempts to explicate an answer to this question and, inter alia, to examine the historical and social forces that have come to threaten the existence of an autonomous political realm, have a distinctly phenomenological character. Arendt's work, if it can be said to do anything, can be said to undertake a phenomenological reconstruction of the nature of political existence, with all that this entails in way of thinking and acting.

The phenomenological nature of Arendt's examination (and indeed defense) of political life can be traced through the profound influence exerted over her by both Heidegger and Jaspers. Heidegger in particular can be seen to have profoundly impacted upon Arendt's thought in for example: in their shared suspicion of the "metaphysical tradition's" move toward abstract contemplation and away from immediate and worldly understanding and engagement, in their critique of modern calculative and instrumental attempts to order and dominate the world, in their emphasis upon the ineliminable plurality and difference that characterize beings as worldly appearances, and so on. This is not, however, to gloss over the profound differences that Arendt had with Heidegger, with not only his political affiliation with the Nazis, or his moves later to philosophical-poetic contemplation and his corresponding abdication from political engagement. Nevertheless, it can justifiably be claimed that Arendt's inquiries follow a crucial impetus from Heidegger's project in Being & Time.

Arendt's distinctive approach as a political thinker can be understood from the impetus drawn from Heidegger's "phenomenology of Being." She proceeds neither by an analysis of general political concepts (such as authority, power, state, sovereignty, etc.) traditionally associated with political philosophy, nor by an aggregative accumulation of empirical data associated with "political science." Rather, beginning from a phenomenological prioritization of the "factical" and experiential character of human life, she adopts a phenomenological method, thereby endeavoring to uncover the fundamental structures of political experience. Eschewing the "free-floating constructions" and conceptual schema imposed a posterioriupon experience by political philosophy, Arendt instead follows phenomenology's return "to the things themselves" (zu den Sachen selbst), aiming by such investigation to make available the objective structures and characteristics of political being-in-the-world, as distinct from other (moral, practical, artistic, productive, etc.) forms of life.

Hence Arendt's explication of the constitutive features of the vita activa in The Human Condition(labor, work, action) can be viewed as the phenomenological uncovering of the structures of human action qua existence and experience rather then abstract conceptual constructions or empirical generalizations about what people typically do. That is, they approximate with respect to the specificity of the political field the 'existentials', the articulations of Dasein's Being set out be Heidegger in Being and Time.

This phenomenological approach to the political partakes of a more general revaluation or reversal of the priority traditionally ascribed to philosophical conceptualizations over and above lived experience. That is, the world of common experience and interpretation (Lebenswelt) is taken to be primary and theoretical knowledge is dependent on that common experience in the form of a thematization or extrapolation from what is primordially and pre-reflectively present in everyday experience. It follows, for Arendt, that political philosophy has a fundamentally ambiguous role in its relation to political experience, insofar as its conceptual formulations do not simply articulate the structures of pre-reflective experience but can equally obscure them, becoming self-subsistent preconceptions which stand between philosophical inquiry and the experiences in question, distorting the phenomenal core of experience by imposing upon it the lens of its own prejudices. Therefore, Arendt sees the conceptual core of traditional political philosophy as an impediment, because as it inserts presuppositions between the inquirer and the political phenomena in question. Rather than following Husserl's methodological prescription of a "bracketing" (epoché) of the prevalent philosophical posture, Arendt's follows Heidegger's historical Abbau or Destruktion to clear away the distorting encrustations of the philosophical tradition, thereby aiming to uncover the originary character of political experience which has for the most part been occluded.

There is no simple way of presenting Arendt's diverse inquiries into the nature and fate of the political, conceived as a distinctive mode of human experience and existence. Her corpus of writings present a range of arguments, and develop a range of conceptual distinctions, that overlap from text to text, forming a web of inter-related excurses. Therefore, perhaps the only way to proceed is to present a summation of her major works, in roughly chronological order, while nevertheless attempting to highlight the continuities that draw them together into a coherent whole.

3. On Totalitarianism

Arendt's first major work, published in 1951, is clearly a response to the devastating events of her own time - the rise of Nazi Germany and the catastrophic fate of European Jewry at its hands, the rise of Soviet Stalinism and its annihilation of millions of peasants (not to mention free-thinking intellectual, writers, artists, scientists and political activists). Arendt insisted that these manifestations of political evil could not be understood as mere extensions in scale or scope of already existing precedents, but rather that they represented a completely 'novel form of government', one built upon terror and ideological fiction. Where older tyrannies had used terror as an instrument for attaining or sustaining power, modern totalitarian regimes exhibited little strategic rationality in their use of terror. Rather, terror was no longer a means to a political end, but an end in itself. Its necessity was now justified by recourse to supposed laws of history (such as the inevitable triumph of the classless society) or nature (such as the inevitability of a war between "chosen" and other "degenerate" races).

For Arendt, the popular appeal of totalitarian ideologies with their capacity to mobilize populations to do their bidding, rested upon the devastation of ordered and stable contexts in which people once lived. The impact of the First World War, and the Great Depression, and the spread of revolutionary unrest, left people open to the promulgation of a single, clear and unambiguous idea that would allocate responsibility for woes, and indicate a clear path that would secure the future against insecurity and danger. Totalitarian ideologies offered just such answers, purporting discovered a "key to history" with which events of the past and present could be explained, and the future secured by doing history's or nature's bidding. Accordingly the amenability of European populations to totalitarian ideas was the consequence of a series of pathologies that had eroded the public or political realm as a space of liberty and freedom. These pathologies included the expansionism of imperialist capital with its administrative management of colonial suppression, and the usurpation of the state by the bourgeoisie as an instrument by which to further its own sectional interests. This in turn led to the delegitimation of political institutions, and the atrophy of the principles of citizenship and deliberative consensus that had been the heart of the democratic political enterprise. The rise of totalitarianism was thus to be understood in light of the accumulation of pathologies that had undermined the conditions of possibility for a viable public life that could unite citizens, while simultaneously preserving their liberty and uniqueness (a condition that Arendt referred to as "plurality").

In this early work, it is possible to discern a number of the recurrent themes that would organize Arendt's political writings throughout her life. For example, the inquiry into the conditions of possibility for a humane and democratic public life, the historical, social and economic forces that had come to threaten it, the conflictual relationship between private interests and the public good, the impact of intensified cycles of production and consumption that destabilized the common world context of human life, and so on. These themes would not only surface again and again in Arendt's subsequent work, but would be conceptually elaborated through the development of key distinctions in order to delineate the nature of political existence and the faculties exercised in its production and preservation.

4. The Human Condition

The work of establishing the conditions of possibility for political experience, as opposed to other spheres of human activity, was undertaken by Arendt in her next major work, The Human Condition (1958). In this work she undertakes a thorough historical-philosophical inquiry that returned to the origins of both democracy and political philosophy in the Ancient Greek world, and brought these originary understandings of political life to bear on what Arendt saw as its atrophy and eclipse in the modern era. Her goal was to propose a phenomenological reconstruction of different aspects of human activity, so as to better discern the type of action and engagement that corresponded to present political existence. In doing so, she offers a stringent critique of traditional of political philosophy, and the dangers it presents to the political sphere as an autonomous domain of human practice.


The Human Condition is fundamentally concerned with the problem of reasserting the politics as a valuable ream of human action, praxis, and the world of appearances. Arendt argues that the Western philosophical tradition has devalued the world of human action which attends to appearances (the vita activa), subordinating it to the life of contemplation which concerns itself with essences and the eternal (the vita contemplativa). The prime culprit is Plato, whose metaphysics subordinates action and appearances to the eternal realm of the Ideas. The allegory of The Cave in The Republic begins the tradition of political philosophy; here Plato describes the world of human affairs in terms of shadows and darkness, and instructs those who aspire to truth to turn away from it in favor of the "clear sky of eternal ideas." This metaphysical hierarchy, theôria is placed above praxis and epistêmê over mere doxa. The realm of action and appearance (including the political) is subordinated to and becomes instrumental for the ends of the Ideas as revealed to the philosopher who lives the bios theôretikos. In The Human Condition and subsequent works, the task Arendt set herself is to save action and appearance, and with it the common life of the political and the values of opinion, from the depredations of the philosophers. By systematically elaborating what this vita activa might be said to entail, she hopes to reinstate the life of public and political action to apex of human goods and goals.

a. The Vita Activa: Labor, Work and Action

In The Human Condition Arendt argues for a tripartite division between the human activities of labor, work, and action. Moreover, she arranges these activities in an ascending hierarchy of importance, and identifies the overturning of this hierarchy as central to the eclipse of political freedom and responsibility which, for her, has come to characterize the modern age.

i. Labor: Humanity as Animal Laborans

Labor is that activity which corresponds to the biological processes and necessities of human existence, the practices which are necessary for the maintenance of life itself. Labor is distinguished by its never-ending character; it creates nothing of permanence, its efforts are quickly consumed, and must therefore be perpetually renewed so as to sustain life. In this aspect of its existence humanity is closest to the animals and so, in a significant sense, the least human ("What men [sic] share with all other forms of animal life was not considered to be human"). Indeed, Arendt refers to humanity in this mode as animal laborans. Because the activity of labor is commanded by necessity, the human being as laborer is the equivalent of the slave; labor is characterized by unfreedom. Arendt argues that it is precisely the recognition of labor as contrary to freedom, and thus to what is distinctively human, which underlay the institution of slavery amongst the ancient Greeks; it was the attempt to exclude labor from the conditions of human life. In view of this characterization of labor, it is unsurprising that Arendt is highly critical of Marx's elevation of animal laborans to a position of primacy in his vision of the highest ends of human existence. Drawing on the Aristotelian distinction of the oikos (the private realm of the household) from the polis (the public realm of the political community), Arendt argues that matters of labor, economy and the like properly belong to the former, not the latter. The emergence of necessary labor , the private concerns of the oikos, into the public sphere (what Arendt calls "the rise of the social") has for her the effect of destroying the properly political by subordinating the public realm of human freedom to the concerns mere animal necessity. The prioritization of the economic which has attended the rise of capitalism has for Arendt all but eclipsed the possibilities of meaningful political agency and the pursuit of higher ends which should be the proper concern of public life.

ii. Work: Humanity as Homo Faber

If labor relates to the natural and biologically necessitated dimension of human existence, then work is "the activity which corresponds to the unnaturalness of human existence, which is not embedded in, and whose mortality is not compensated by, the species' ever-recurring life-cycle." Work (as both technê andpoiesis) corresponds to the fabrication of an artificial world of things, artifactual constructions which endure temporally beyond the act of creation itself. Work thus creates a world distinct from anything given in nature, a world distinguished by its durability, its semi-permanence and relative independence from the individual actors and acts which call it into being. Humanity in this mode of its activity Arendt names homo faber; he/she is the builder of walls (both physical and cultural) which divide the human realm from that of nature and provide a stable context (a "common world") of spaces and institutions within which human life can unfold. Homo faber's typical representatives are the builder, the architect, the craftsperson, the artist and the legislator, as they create the public world both physically and institutionally by constructing buildings and making laws.

It should be clear that work stands in clear distinction from labor in a number of ways. Firstly, whereas labor is bound to the demands of animality, biology and nature, work violates the realm of nature by shaping and transforming it according to the plans and needs of humans; this makes work a distinctly human (i.e. non-animal) activity. Secondly, because work is governed by human ends and intentions it is under humans' sovereignty and control, it exhibits a certain quality of freedom, unlike labor which is subject to nature and necessity. Thirdly, whereas labor is concerned with satisfying the individual's life-needs and so remains essentially a private affair, work is inherently public; it creates an objective and common world which both stands between humans and unites them. While work is not the mode of human activity which corresponds to politics, its fabrications are nonetheless the preconditions for the existence of a political community. The common world of institutions and spaces that work creates furnish the arena in which citizens may come together as members of that shared world to engage in political activity. In Arendt's critique of modernity the world created by homo faber is threatened with extinction by the aforementioned "rise of the social." The activity of labor and the consumption of its fruits, which have come to dominate the public sphere, cannot furnish a common world within which humans might pursue their higher ends. Labor and its effects are inherently impermanent and perishable, exhausted as they are consumed, and so do not possess the qualities of quasi-permanence which are necessary for a shared environment and common heritage which endures between people and across time. In industrial modernity "all the values characteristic of the world of fabrication - permanence, stability, durability...are sacrificed in favor of the values of life, productivity and abundance." The rise of animal laborans threatens the extinction of homo faber, and with it comes the passing of those worldly conditions which make a community's collective and public life possible (what Arendt refers to as "world alienation").

iii. Action: Humanity as Zoon Politikon

So, we have the activity of labor which meets the needs that are essential for the maintenance of humanities physical existence, but by virtue of its necessary quality occupies the lowest rung on the hierarchy of the vita activa. Then we have work, which is a distinctly human (i.e. non-animal) activity which fabricates the enduring, public and common world of our collective existence. However, Arendt is at great pains to establish that the activity of homo faber does not equate with the realm of human freedom and so cannot occupy the privileged apex of the human condition. For work is still subject to a certain kind of necessity, that which arises from its essentially instrumental character. As technê andpoiesis the act is dictated by and subordinated to ends and goals outside itself; work is essentially ameans to achieve the thing which is to be fabricated (be it a work of art, a building or a structure of legal relations) and so stands in a relation of mere purposiveness to that end. (Again it is Plato who stands accused of the instrumentalization of action, of its conflation with fabrication and subordination to an external teleology as prescribed by his metaphysical system). For Arendt, the activity of work cannot be fully free insofar as it is not an end in itself, but is determined by prior causes and articulated ends. The quality of freedom in the world of appearances (which for Arendt is the sine qua non of politics) is to be found elsewhere in the vita activa, namely with the activity of action proper.

The fundamental defining quality of action is its ineliminable freedom, its status as an end in itself and so as subordinate to nothing outside itself. Arendt argues that it is a mistake to take freedom to be primarily an inner, contemplative or private phenomenon, for it is in fact active, worldly and public. Our sense of an inner freedom is derivative upon first having experienced "a condition of being free as a tangible worldly reality. We first become aware of freedom or its opposite in our intercourse with others, not in the intercourse with ourselves." In defining action as freedom, and freedom as action, we can see the decisive influence of Augustine upon Arendt's thought. From Augustine's political philosophy she takes the theme of human action as beginning:

To act, in its most general sense, means to take initiative, to begin (as the Greek word archein, 'to begin,' 'to lead,' and eventually 'to rule' indicates), to set something in motion. Because they are initium, newcomers and beginners by virtue of birth, men take initiative, are prompted into action.

And further, that freedom is to be seen:

as a character of human existence in the world. Man does not so much possess freedom as he, or better his coming into the world, is equated with the appearance of freedom in the universe; man is free because he is a beginning...

In short, humanity represents/articulates/embodies the faculty of beginning. It follows from this equation of freedom, action and beginning that freedom is "an accessory of doing and acting;" "Men are long as they act, neither before nor after; for to be free and to act are the same." This capacity for initiation gives actions the character of singularity and uniqueness, as "it is in the nature of beginning that something new is started which cannot be expected from whatever happened before." So, intrinsic to the human capacity for action is the introduction of genuine novelty, the unexpected, unanticipated and unpredictable into the world:

The new always happens against the overwhelming odds of statistical laws and their probability, which for all practical, everyday purposes amounts to certainty; the new therefore always appears in the guise of a miracle.

This "miraculous," initiatory quality distinguishes genuine action from mere behavior i.e. from conduct which has an habituated, regulated, automated character; behavior falls under the determinations ofprocess, is thoroughly conditioned by causal antecedents, and so is essentially unfree. The definition of human action in terms of freedom and novelty places it outside the realm of necessity or predictability. Herein lies the basis of Arendt's quarrel with Hegel and Marx, for to define politics or the unfolding of history in terms of any teleology or immanent or objective process is to deny what is central to authentic human action, namely, its capacity to initiate the wholly new, unanticipated, unexpected, unconditioned by the laws of cause and effect.

It has been argued that Arendt is a political existentialist who, in seeking the greatest possible autonomy for action, falls into the danger of aestheticising action and advocating decisionism. Yet political existentialism lays great stress on individual will and on decision as "an act of existential choice unconstrained by principles or norms." In contradistinction, Arendt's theory holds that actions cannot be justified for their own sake, but only in light of their public recognition and the shared rules of a political community. For Arendt, action is a public category, a worldly practice that is experienced in our intercourse with others, and so is a practice that "both presupposes and can be actualized only in a human polity." As Arendt puts it:

Action, the only activity that goes on directly between men...corresponds to the human condition of plurality, to the fact that men, not Man, live on the earth and inhabit the world. While all aspects of the human condition are somehow related to politics, this plurality is specifically the condition - not only theconditio sine qua non, but the conditio per quam - of all political life .

Another way of understanding the importance of publicity and plurality for action is to appreciate that action would be meaningless unless there were others present to see it and so give meaning to it. The meaning of the action and the identity of the actor can only be established in the context of human plurality, the presence others sufficiently like ourselves both to understand us and recognize the uniqueness of ourselves and our acts. This communicative and disclosive quality of action is clear in the way that Arendt connects action most centrally to speech. It is through action as speech that individuals come to disclose their distinctive identity: "Action is the public disclosure of the agent in the speech deed." Action of this character requires a public space in which it can be realized, a context in which individuals can encounter one another as members of a community. For this space, as for much else, Arendt turns to the ancients, holding up the Athenian polis as the model for such a space of communicative and disclosive speech deeds. Such action is for Arendt synonymous with the political; politics is the ongoing activity of citizens coming together so as to exercise their capacity for agency, to conduct their lives together by means of free speech and persuasion. Politics and the exercise of freedom-as-action are one and the same:

… actually the reason that men live together in political organisations at all. Without it, political life as such would be meaningless. The raison d'être of politics is freedom, and its field of experience is action.

5. On Revolution

From the historical-philosophical treatment of the political in The Human Condition, it might appear that for Arendt an authentic politics (as freedom of action, public deliberation and disclosure) has been decisively lost in the modern era. Yet in her next major work, On Revolution (1961) she takes her rethinking of political concepts and applies them to the modern era, with ambivalent results.

Arendt takes issue with both liberal and Marxist interpretations of modern political revolutions (such as the French and American). Against liberals, the disputes the claim that these revolutions were primarily concerned with the establishment of a limited government that would make space for individual liberty beyond the reach of the state. Against Marxist interpretations of the French Revolution, she disputes the claim that it was driven by the "social question," a popular attempt to overcome poverty and exclusion by the many against the few who monopolized wealth in the ancien regime. Rather, Arendt claims, what distinguishes these modern revolutions is that they exhibit (albeit fleetingly) the exercise of fundamental political capacities - that of individuals acting together, on the basis of their mutually agreed common purposes, in order to establish a tangible public space of freedom. It is in this instauration, the attempt to establish a public and institutional space of civic freedom and participation, that marks out these revolutionary moments as exemplars of politics qua action.

Yet Arendt sees both the French and American revolutions as ultimately failing to establish a perduring political space in which the on-going activities of shared deliberation, decision and coordinated action could be exercised. In the case of the French Revolution, the subordination of political freedom to matters of managing welfare (the "social question") reduces political institutions to administering the distribution of goods and resources (matters that belong properly in the oikos, dealing as they do with the production and reproduction of human existence). Meanwhile, the American Revolution evaded this fate, and by means of the Constitution managed to found a political society on the basis of comment assent. Yet she saw it only as a partial and limited success. America failed to create an institutional space in which citizens could participate in government, in which they could exercise in common those capacities of free expression, persuasion and judgement that defined political existence. The average citizen, while protected from arbitrary exercise of authority by constitutional checks and balances, was no longer a participant "in judgement and authority," and so became denied the possibility of exercising his/her political capacities.

6. Eichmann and the "Banality of Evil"

Published in the same year as On Revolution, Arendt's book about the Eichmann trial presents both a continuity with her previous works, but also a change in emphasis that would continue to the end of her life. This work marks a shift in her concerns from the nature of political action, to a concern with the faculties that underpin it - the interrelated activities of thinking and judging.

She controversially uses the phrase "the banality of evil" to characterize Eichmann's actions as a member of the Nazi regime, in particular his role as chief architect and executioner of Hitler's genocidal "final solution" (Endlosung) for the "Jewish problem." Her characterization of these actions, so obscene in their nature and consequences, as "banal" is not meant to position them as workaday. Rather it is meant to contest the prevalent depictions of the Nazi's inexplicable atrocities as having emanated from a malevolent will to do evil, a delight in murder. As far as Arendt could discern, Eichmann came to his willing involvement with the program of genocide through a failure or absence of the faculties of sound thinking and judgement. From Eichmann's trial in Jerusalem (where he had been brought after Israeli agents found him in hiding in Argentina), Arendt concluded that far from exhibiting a malevolent hatred of Jews which could have accounted psychologically for his participation in the Holocaust, Eichmann was an utterly innocuous individual. He operated unthinkingly, following orders, efficiently carrying them out, with no consideration of their effects upon those he targeted. The human dimension of these activities were not entertained, so the extermination of the Jews became indistinguishable from any other bureaucratically assigned and discharged responsibility for Eichmann and his cohorts.

Arendt concluded that Eichmann was constitutively incapable of exercising the kind of judgement that would have made his victims' suffering real or apparent for him. It was not the presence of hatred that enabled Eichmann to perpetrate the genocide, but the absence of the imaginative capacities that would have made the human and moral dimensions of his activities tangible for him. Eichmann failed to exercise his capacity of thinking, of having an internal dialogue with himself, which would have permitted self-awareness of the evil nature of his deeds. This amounted to a failure to use self-reflection as a basis forjudgement, the faculty that would have required Eichmann to exercise his imagination so as to contemplate the nature of his deeds from the experiential standpoint of his victims. This connection between the complicity with political evil and the failure of thinking and judgement inspired the last phase of Arendt's work, which sought to explicate the nature of these faculties and their constitutive role for politically and morally responsible choices.

7. Thinking and Judging

Arendt's concern with thinking and judgement as political faculties stretches back to her earliest works, and were addressed subsequently in a number of essays written during the 1950s and 1960s. However, in the last phase of her work, she turned to examine these faculties in a concerted and systematic way. Unfortunately, her work was incomplete at the time of her death - only the first two volumes of the projected 3-volume work, Life of the Mind, had been completed. However, the posthumously publishedLectures on Kant's Political Philosophy delineate what might reasonably be supposed as her "mature" reflections on political judgement.

In the first volume of Life of the Mind, dealing with the faculty of thinking, Arendt is at pains to distinguish it from "knowing." She draws upon Kant's distinction between knowing or understanding (Verstand) and thinking or reasoning (Vernunft). Understanding yields positive knowledge - it is the quest for knowable truths. Reason or thinking, on the other hand, drives us beyond knowledge, persistently posing questions that cannot be answered from the standpoint of knowledge, but which we nonetheless cannot refrain from asking. For Arendt, thinking amounts to a quest to understand the meaning of our world, the ceaseless and restless activity of questioning that which we encounter. The value of thinking is not that it yields positive results that can be considered settled, but that it constantly returns to question again and again the meaning that we give to experiences, actions and circumstances. This, for Arendt, is intrinsic to the exercise of political responsibility - the engagement of this faculty that seeks meaning through a relentless questioning (including self-questioning). It was precisely the failure of this capacity that characterized the "banality" of Eichmann's propensity to participate in political evil.

The cognate faculty of judgement has attracted most attention is her writing on, deeply inter-connected with thinking, yet standing distinct from it. Her theory of judgement is widely considered as one of the most original parts of her oeuvre, and certainly one of the most influential in recent years.

Arendt's concern with political judgement, and its crisis in the modern era, is a recurrent theme in her work. As noted earlier, Arendt bemoans the "world alienation" that characterizes the modern era, the destruction of a stable institutional and experiential world that could provide a stable context in which humans could organize their collective existence. Moreover, it will be recalled that in human action Arendt recognizes (for good or ill) the capacity to bring the new, unexpected, and unanticipated into the world. This quality of action means that it constantly threatens to defy or exceed our existing categories of understanding or judgement; precedents and rules cannot help us judge properly what is unprecedented and new. So for Arendt, our categories and standards of thought are always beset by their potential inadequacy with respect to that which they are called upon to judge. However, this aporia of judgement reaches a crisis point in the 20th century under the repeated impact of its monstrous and unprecedented events. The mass destruction of two World Wars, the development of technologies which threaten global annihilation, the rise of totalitarianism, and the murder of millions in the Nazi death camps and Stalin's purges have effectively exploded our existing standards for moral and political judgement. Tradition lies in shattered fragments around us and "the very framework within which understanding and judging could arise is gone." The shared bases of understanding, handed down to us in our tradition, seem irretrievably lost. Arendt confronts the question: on what basis can one judge the unprecedented, the incredible, the monstrous which defies our established understandings and experiences? If we are to judge at all, it must now be "without preconceived categories and...without the set of customary rules which is morality;" it must be "thinking without a banister." In order to secure the possibility of such judgement Arendt must establish that there in fact exists "an independent human faculty, unsupported by law and public opinion, that judges anew in full spontaneity every deed and intent whenever the occasion arises." This for Arendt comes to represent "one of the central moral questions of all time, namely...the nature and function of human judgement." It is with this goal and this question in mind that the work of Arendt's final years converges on the "unwritten political philosophy" of Kant's Critique of Judgement.

Arendt eschews "determinate judgement," judgement that subsumes particulars under a universal or rule that already exists. Instead, she turns to Kant's account of "reflective judgement," the judgement of a particular for which no rule or precedent exists, but for which some judgement must nevertheless be arrived at. What Arendt finds so valuable in Kant's account is that reflective judgement proceeds from the particular with which it is confronted, yet nevertheless has a universalizing moment - it proceeds from the operation of a capacity that is shared by all beings possessed of the faculties of reason and understanding. Kant requires us to judge from this common standpoint, on the basis of what we share with all others, by setting aside our own egocentric and private concerns or interests. The faculty of reflective judgement requires us to set aside considerations which are purely private (matters of personal liking and private interest) and instead judge from the perspective of what we share in common with others (i.e. must bedisinterested). Arendt places great weight upon this notion of a faculty of judgement that "thinks from the standpoint of everyone else." This "broadened way of thinking" or "enlarged mentality" enables us to "compare our judgement not so much with the actual as rather with the merely possible judgement of others, and [thus] put ourselves in the position of everybody else..." For Arendt, this "representative thinking" is made possible by the exercise of the imagination - as Arendt beautifully puts it, "To think with an enlarged mentality means that one trains one's imagination to go visiting." "Going visiting" in this way enables us to make individual, particular acts of judgement which can nevertheless claim a public validity. In this faculty, Arendt find a basis upon which a disinterested and publicly-minded form of political judgement could subvene, yet be capable of tackling the unprecedented circumstances and choices that the modern era confronts us with.

8. Influence

We can briefly consider the influence that Arendt's work has exerted over other political thinkers. This is not easy to summarize, as many and varied scholars have sought inspiration from some part or other of Arendt's work. However, we may note the importance that her studies have had for the theory and analysis of totalitarianism and the nature and origins of political violence. Similarly, her reflections on the distinctiveness of modern democratic revolutions have been important in the development of republican thought, and for the recent revival of interest in civic mobilizations and social movements (particularly in the wake of 1989's 'velvet revolutions' in the former communist states of Eastern and Central Europe).

More specifically, Arendt has decisively influenced critical and emancipatory attempts to theorize political reasoning and deliberation. For example, Jürgen Habermas admits the formative influence of Arendt upon his own theory of communicative reason and discourse ethics. Particularly important is the way in which Arendt comes to understand power, namely as "the capacity to agree in uncoerced communication on some community action." Her model of action as public, communicative, persuasive and consensual reappears in Habermas' thought in concepts such as that of "communicative power" which comes about whenever members of a life-world act in concert via the medium of language. It also reappears in his critique of the "scientization of politics" and his concomitant defense of practical, normative reason in the domain of life-world relations from the hegemony of theoretical and technical modes of reasoning. Others (such as Jean-Luc Nancy) have likewise been influenced by her critique of the modern technological "leveling" of human distinctiveness, often reading Arendt's account in tandem with Heidegger's critique of technology. Her theory of judgement has been used by Critical Theorists and Postmoderns alike. Amongst the former, Seyla Benhabib draws explicitly and extensively upon it in order to save discourse ethics from its own universalist excesses; Arendt's attention to the particular, concrete, unique and lived phenomena of human life furnishes Benhabib with a strong corrective for Habermas' tendency for abstraction, while nonetheless preserving the project of a universalizing vision of ethical-political life. For the Postmoderns, such as Lyotard, the emphasis placed upon reflective judgement furnishes a "post-foundational" or "post-universalist" basis in which the singularity of moral judgements can be reconciled with some kind of collective adherence to political principles.

9. Criticisms and Controversies

It is worth noting some of the prominent criticisms that have been leveled against Arendt's work.

Primary amongst these is her reliance upon a rigid distinction between the "private" and "public," the oikos and the polis, to delimit the specificity of the political realm. Feminists have pointed out that the confinement of the political to the realm outside the household has been part and parcel of the domination of politics by men, and the corresponding exclusion of women's experiences of subjection from legitimate politics. Marxists have likewise pointed to the consequences of confining matters of material distribution and economic management to the extra-political realm of the oikos, thereby delegitimating questions of material social justice, poverty, and exploitation from political discussion and contestation. The shortcoming of this distinction in Arendt's work is amply illustrated by a well-known and often-cited incident. While attending a conference in 1972, she was put under question by the Frankfurt School Critical Theorist Albrecht Wellmer, regarding her distinction of the "political" and the "social," and its consequences. Arendt pronounced that housing and homelessness (themes of the conference) were not political issues, but that they were external to the political as the sphere of the actualization of freedom; the political is about human self-disclosure in speech and deed, not about the distribution of goods, which belongs to the social realm as an extension of the oikos. It may be said that Arendt's attachment to a fundamental and originary understanding of political life precisely misses the fact that politics is intrinsically concerned with the contestation of what counts as a legitimate public concern, with the practice of politics attempting to introduce new, heretofore 'non-political' issues, into realm of legitimate political concern.

Arendt has also come under criticism for her overly enthusiastic endorsement of the Athenian polis as an exemplar of political freedom, to the detriment of modern political regimes and institutions. Likewise, the emphasis she places upon direct citizen deliberation as synonymous with the exercise of political freedom excludes representative models, and might be seen as unworkable in the context of modern mass societies, with the delegation, specialization, expertise and extensive divisions of labor needed to deal with their complexity. Her elevation of politics to the apex of human good and goals has also been challenged, demoting as it does other modes of human action and self-realization to a subordinate status. There are also numerous criticisms that have been leveled at her unorthodox readings of other thinkers, and her attempts to synthesize conflicting philosophical viewpoints in attempt to develop her own position (for example, her attempt to mediate Aristotle's account of experientially-grounded practical judgement (phronesis) with Kant's transcendental-formal model).

All these, and other criticisms notwithstanding, Arendt remains one of the most original, challenging and influential political thinkers of the 20th century, and her work will no doubt continue to provide inspiration for political philosophy as we enter the 21st.

10. References and Further Reading

a. Major Works by Arendt

  • The Origins of Totalitarianism, New York, Harcourt, 1951
  • The Human Condition, Chicago, University of Chicago Press, 1958
  • Between Past and Future, London, Faber & Faber, 1961
  • On Revolution. New York, Penguin, 1962
  • Eichmann in Jerusalem: a Report on the Banality of Evil, London, Faber & Faber, 1963
  • On Violence, New York, Harcourt, 1970
  • Men in Dark Times, New York, Harcourt, 1968
  • Crisis of the Republic, New York, Harcourt, 1972
  • The Life of the Mind, 2 vols., London, Secker & Warburg, 1978
  • Lectures on Kant's Political Philosophy, Brighton, Harvester Press, 1982
  • Love and St. Augustin, Chicago, University of Chicago Press, 1996

b. Recommended Further Reading

  • Benhabib, Seyla: The Reluctant Modernism of Hannah Arendt. London, Sage, 1996
  • Bernstein, Richard J: 'Hannah Arendt: The Ambiguities of Theory and Practice', in Political Theory and Praxis: New Perspectives, Terence Ball (ed.). Minneapolis, University of Minnesota Press, 1977
  • Bernstein, Richard J: Philosophical Profiles: Essays in a Pragmatic Mode. Cambridge, Polity Press, 1986
  • Critchley, Simon & Schroeder, William (eds): A Companion to Continental Philosophy. Oxford, Blackwell, 1998
  • d'Entrèves, Maurizio Passerin: The Political Philosophy of Hannah Arendt. London, Routledge, 1994
  • Flynn, Bernard: Political Philosophy at the Closure of Metaphysics. New Jersey/London: Humanities Press International, 1992
  • Habermas, Jürgen: 'Hannah Arendt: On the Concept of Power' in Philosophical-Political Profiles. London, Heinemman, 1983
  • Hinchman, Lewis P. & Hinchman, Sandra K: 'In Heidegger's Shadow: Hannah Arendt's Phenomenological Humanism', in The Review of Politics, 46, 2, 1984, pp 183-211
  • Kielmansegg, Peter G., Mewes, Horst & Glaser-Schmidt, Elisabeth(eds): Hannah Arendt and Leo Strauss: German Emigrés and American Political Thought after World War II. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 1995
  • Lacoue-Labarthe, Philippe & Nancy, Jean-Luc: Retreating the Political, Simon Sparks (ed). London, Routledge, 1997
  • Parekh, Bhikhu: Hannah Arendt & The Search for a New Political Philosophy. London & Basingstoke, Macmillan Press, 1981
  • Villa, Dana: Arendt and Heidegger: The Fate of the Political. Princeton, New Jersey, Princeton University Press, 1996
  • Villa, Dana (ed): The Cambridge Companion to Arendt. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 2000

Author Information

Majid Yar
Lancaster University
United Kingdom

Aristotle: Ethics

aristotleStandard interpretations of Aristotle’s Nichomachean Ethics usually maintain that Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.) emphasizes the role of habit in conduct. It is commonly thought that virtues, according to Aristotle, are habits and that the good life is a life of mindless routine.

These interpretations of Aristotle’s ethics are the result of imprecise translations from the ancient Greek text. Aristotle uses the word hexis to denote moral virtue. But the word does not merely mean passive habituation. Rather, hexis is an active condition, a state in which something must actively hold itself.

Virtue, therefore, manifests itself in action. More explicitly, an action counts as virtuous, according to Aristotle, when one holds oneself in a stable equilibrium of the soul, in order to choose the action knowingly and for its own sake. This stable equilibrium of the soul is what constitutes character.

Similarly, Aristotle’s concept of the mean is often misunderstood. In the Nichomachean Ethics, Aristotle repeatedly states that virtue is a mean. The mean is a state of clarification and apprehension in the midst of pleasures and pains that allows one to judge what seems most truly pleasant or painful. This active state of the soul is the condition in which all the powers of the soul are at work in concert. Achieving good character is a process of clearing away the obstacles that stand in the way of the full efficacy of the soul.

For Aristotle, moral virtue is the only practical road to effective action. What the person of good character loves with right desire and t.hinks of as an end with right reason must first be perceived as beautiful. Hence, the virtuous person sees truly and judges rightly, since beautiful things appear as they truly are only to a person of good character. It is only in the middle ground between habits of acting and principles of action that the soul can allow right desire and right reason to make their appearance, as the direct and natural response of a free human being to the sight of the beautiful.

Table of Contents

  1. Habit
  2. The Mean
  3. Noble
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Habit

In many discussions, the word "habit" is attached to the Ethics as though it were the answer to a multiple-choice question on a philosophy achievement test. HobbesLeviathan? Self-preservation. DescartesMeditations? Mind-body problem. Aristotle's Ethics? Habit. A faculty seminar I attended a few years ago was mired in the opinion that Aristotle thinks the good life is one of mindless routine. More recently, I heard a lecture in which some very good things were said about Aristotle's discussion of c.hoice, yet the speaker still criticized him for praising habit when so much that is important in life depends on openness and spontaneity. Can it really be that Aristotle thought life is lived best when thinking and choosing are eliminated?

On its face this belief makes no sense. It is partly a confusion between an effect and one of its causes. Aristotle says that, for the way our lives turn out, "it makes no small difference to be habituated this way or that way straight from childhood, but an enormous difference, or rather all the difference." (1103b, 23-5) Is this not the same as saying those lives are nothing but collections of habits? If this is what sticks in your memory, and leads you to that conclusion, then the cure is easy, since habits are not the only effects of habituation, and a thing that makes all the difference is indispensable but not necessarily the only cause of what it produces.

We will work through this thought in a moment, but first we need to notice that another kind of influence may be at work when you recall what Aristotle says about habit, and another kind of medicine may be needed against it. Are you thinking that no matter how we analyze the effects of habituation, we will never get around the fact that Aristotle plainly says that virtues are habits? The reply to that difficulty is that he doesn't say that at all. He says that moral virtue is a hexis. Hippocrates Apostle, and others, translate hexis as habit, but that is not at all what it means. The trouble, as so often in these matters, is the intrusion of Latin. The Latin habitus is a perfectly good translation of the Greek hexis, but if that detour gets us to habit in English we have lost our way. In fact, a hexisis pretty much the opposite of a habit.

The word hexis becomes an issue in Plato's Theaetetus. Socrates makes the point that knowledge can never be a mere passive possession, stored in the memory the way birds can be put in cages. The word for that sort of possession, ktÎsis, is contrasted with hexis, the kind of having-and-holding that is never passive but always at work right now. Socrates thus suggests that, whatever knowledge is, it must have the character of a hexis in requiring the effort of concentrating or paying attention. A hexis is an active condition, a state in which something must actively hold itself, and that is what Aristotle says a moral virtue is.

Some translators make Aristotle say that virtue is a disposition, or a settled disposition. This is much better than calling it a "habit," but still sounds too passive to capture his meaning. In De Anima, when Aristotle speaks of the effect produced in us by an object of sense perception, he says this is not a disposition (diathesis) but a hexis. (417b, 15-17) His whole account of sensing and knowing depends on this notion that receptivity to what is outside us depends on an active effort to hold ourselves ready. In Book VII of the Physics, Aristotle says much the same thing about the way children start to learn: they are not changed, he says, nor are they trained or even acted upon in any way, but they themselves get straight into an active state when time or adults help them settle down out of their native condition of disorder and distraction. (247b, 17-248a, 6) Curtis Wilson once delivered a lecture at St. John's College, in which he asked his audience to imagine what it would be like if we had to teach children to speak by deliberately and explicitly imparting everything they had to do. We somehow set them free to speak, and give them a particular language to do it in, but they--Mr. Wilson called them "little geniuses"--they do all the work.

Everyone at St. John's has thought about the kind of learning that does not depend on the authority of the teacher and the memory of the learner. In the Meno it is called "recollection." Aristotle says that it is an active knowing that is always already at work in us. In Plato's image we draw knowledge up out of ourselves; in Aristotle's metaphor we settle down into knowing. In neither account is it possible for anyone to train us, as Gorgias has habituated Meno into the mannerisms of a knower. Habits can be strong but they never go deep. Authentic knowledge does engage the soul in its depths, and with this sort of knowing Aristotle links virtue. In the passage cited from Book VII of the Physics, he says that, like knowledge, virtues are not imposed on us as alterations of what we are; that would be, he says, like saying we alter a house when we put a roof on it. In the Categories, knowledge and virtue are the two examples he gives of what hexis means (8b, 29); there he says that these active states belong in the general class of dispositions, but are distinguished by being lasting and durable. The word "disposition" by itself he reserves for more passive states, easy to remove and change, such as heat, cold, and sickness.

In the Ethics, Aristotle identifies moral virtue as a hexis in Book II, chapter 4. He confirms this identity by reviewing the kinds of things that are in the soul, and eliminating the feelings and impulses to which we are passive and the capacities we have by nature, but he first discovers what sort of thing a virtue is by observing that the goodness is never in the action but only in the doer. This is an enormous claim that pervades the whole of the Ethics, and one that we need to stay attentive to. No action is good or just or courageous because of any quality in itself. Virtue manifests itself in action, Aristotle says, only when one acts while holding oneself in a certain way. This is where the word hexis comes into the account, from pÙs echÙn, the stance in which one holds oneself when acting. The indefinite adverb is immediately explained: an action counts as virtuous when and only when one holds oneself in a stable equilibrium of the soul, in order to choose the action knowingly and for its own sake. I am translating as "in a stable equilibrium" the words bebaiÙs kai ametakinÍtÙs; the first of these adverbs means stably or after having taken a stand, while the second does not mean rigid or immovable, but in a condition from which one can't be moved all the way over into a different condition. It is not some inflexible adherence to rules or duty or precedent that is conveyed here, but something like a Newton's wheel weighted below the center, or one of those toys that pops back upright whenever a child knocks it over.

This stable equilibrium of the soul is what we mean by having character. It is not the result of what we call "conditioning." There is a story told about B. F. Skinner, the psychologist most associated with the idea of behavior modification, that a class of his once trained him to lecture always from one corner of the room, by smiling and nodding whenever he approached it, but frowning and faintly shaking their heads when he moved away from it. That is the way we acquire habits. We slip into them unawares, or let them be imposed on us, or even impose them on ourselves. A person with ever so many habits may still have no character. Habits make for repetitive and predictable behavior, but character gives moral equilibrium to a life. The difference is between a foolish consistency wholly confined to the level of acting, and a reliability in that part of us from which actions have their source. Different as they are, though, character and habit sound to us like things that are linked, and in Greek they differ only by the change of an epsilon to an eta, making Íthos from ethos

We are finally back to Aristotle's claim that character, Íthos, is produced by habit, ethos. It should now be clear though, that the habit cannot be any part of that character, and that we must try to understand how an active condition can arise as a consequence of a passive one, and why that active condition can only be attained if the passive one has come first. So far we have arranged three notions in a series, like rungs of a ladder: at the top are actives states, such as knowledge, the moral virtues, and the combination of virtues that makes up a character; the middle rung, the mere dispositions, we have mentioned only in passing to claim that they are too shallow and changeable to capture the meaning of virtue; the bottom rung is the place of the habits, and includes biting your nails, twisting your hair, saying "like" between every two words, and all such passive and mindless conditions. What we need to notice now is that there is yet another rung of the ladder below the habits.

We all start out life governed by desires and impulses. Unlike the habits, which are passive but lasting conditions, desires and impulses are passive and momentary, but they are very strong. Listen to a child who can't live without some object of appetite or greed, or who makes you think you are a murderer if you try to leave her alone in a dark room. How can such powerful influences be overcome? To expect a child to let go of the desire or fear that grips her may seem as hopeless as Aristotle's example of training a stone to fall upward, were it not for the fact that we all know that we have somehow, for the most part, broken the power of these tyrannical feelings. We don't expel them altogether, but we do get the upper hand; an adult who has temper tantrums like those of a two-year old has to live in an institution, and not in the adult world. But the impulses and desires don't weaken; it is rather the case that we get stronger.

Aristotle doesn't go into much detail about how this happens, except to say that we get the virtues by working at them: in the give-and-take with other people, some become just, others unjust; by acting in the face of frightening things and being habituated to be fearful or confident, some become brave and others cowardly; and some become moderate and gentle, others spoiled and bad-tempered, by turning around from one thing and toward another in the midst of desires and passions. (1103 b, 1422) He sums this up by saying that when we are at-work in a certain way, an active state results. This innocent sentence seems to me to be one of the lynch-pins that hold together the Ethics, the spot that marks the transition from the language of habit to the language appropriate to character. If you read the sentence in Greek, and have some experience of Aristotle's other writings, you will see how loaded it is, since it says that a hexis depends upon an energeia. The latter word, that can be translated as being-at-work, cannot mean mere behavior, however repetitive and constant it may be. It is this idea of being-at-work, which is central to all of Aristotle's thinking, that makes intelligible the transition out of childhood and into the moral stature that comes with character and virtue. (See Aristotle on Motion and its Place in Nature for as discussion energeia.)

The moral life can be confused with the habits approved by some society and imposed on its young. We at St. John's College still stand up at the beginning and end of Friday-night lectures because Stringfellow Barr -- one of the founders of the current curriculum -- always stood when anyone entered or left a room. What he considered good breeding is for us mere habit; that becomes obvious when some student who stood up at the beginning of a lecture occasionally gets bored and leaves in the middle of it. In such a case the politeness was just for show, and the rudeness is the truth. Why isn't all habituation of the young of this sort? When a parent makes a child repeatedly refrain from some desired thing, or remain in some frightening situation, the child is beginning to act as a moderate or brave person would act, but what is really going on within the child? I used to think that it must be the parent's approval that was becoming stronger than the child's own impulse, but I was persuaded by others in a study group that this alone would be of no lasting value, and would contribute nothing to the formation of an active state of character. What seems more likely is that parental training is needed only for its negative effect, as a way of neutralizing the irrational force of impulses and desires.

We all arrive on the scene already habituated, in the habit, that is, of yielding to impulses and desires, of instantly slackening the tension of pain or fear or unfulfilled desire in any way open to us, and all this has become automatic in us before thinking and choosing are available to us at all. This is a description of what is called "human nature," though in fact it precedes our access to our true natural state, and blocks that access. This is why Aristotle says that "the virtues come about in us neither by nature nor apart from nature" (1103a, 24-5). What we call "human nature," and some philosophers call the "state of nature," is both natural and unnatural; it is the passive part of our natures, passively reinforced by habit. Virtue has the aspect of a second nature, because it cannot develop first, nor by a continuous process out of our first condition. But it is only in the moral virtues that we possess our primary nature, that in which all our capacities can have their full development. The sign of what is natural, for Aristotle, is pleasure, but we have to know how to read the signs. Things pleasant by nature have no opposite pain and no excess, because they set us free to act simply as what we are (1154b, 15-21), and it is in this sense that Aristotle calls the life of virtue pleasant in its own right, in itself (1099a, 6-7, 16-17). A mere habit of acting contrary to our inclinations cannot be a virtue, by the infallible sign that we don't like it.

Our first or childish nature is never eradicated, though, and this is why Aristotle says that our nature is not simple, but also has in it something different that makes our happiness assailable from within, and makes us love change even when it is for the worse. (1154b, 21-32) But our souls are brought nearest to harmony and into the most durable pleasures only by the moral virtues. And the road to these virtues is nothing fancy, but is simply what all parents begin to do who withhold some desired thing from a child, or prevent it from running away from every irrational source of fear. They make the child act, without virtue, as though it had virtue. It is what Hamlet describes to his mother, during a time that is out of joint, when a son must try to train his parent (III, Ìv,181-9):

Assume a virtue if you have it not.
That monster, custom, who all sense doth eat
Of habits evil, is angel yet in this,
That to the use of actions fair and good
He likewise gives a frock or livery,
That aptly is put on. Refrain tonight,
And that shall lend a kind of easiness
To the next abstinence; the next more easy;
For use almost can change the stamp of nature...

Hamlet is talking to a middle-aged woman about lust, but the pattern applies just as well to five-year-olds and candy. We are in a position to see that it is not the stamp of nature that needs to be changed but the earliest stamp of habit. We can drop Hamlet's "almost" and rid his last quoted line of all paradox by seeing that the reason we need habit is to change the stamp of habit. A habit of yielding to impulse can be counteracted by an equal and opposite habit. This second habit is no virtue, but only a mindless inhibition, an automatic repressing of all impulses. Nor do the two opposite habits together produce virtue, but rather a state of neutrality. Something must step into the role previously played by habit, and Aristotle's use of the word energeia suggests that this happens on its own, with no need for anything new to be imposed. Habituation thus does not stifle nature, but rather lets nature make its appearance. The description from Book VII of the Physics of the way children begin to learn applies equally well to the way human character begins to be formed: we settle down, out of the turmoil of childishness, into what we are by nature.

We noticed earlier that habituation is not the end but the beginning of the progress toward virtue. The order of states of the soul given by Aristotle went from habit to being-at-work to the hexis or active state that can give the soul moral stature. If the human soul had no being-at-work, no inherent and indelible activity, there could be no such moral stature, but only customs. But early on, when first trying to give content to the idea of happiness, Aristotle asks if it would make sense to think that a carpenter or shoemaker has work to do, but a human being as such is inert. His reply, of course, is that nature has given us work to do, in default of which we are necessarily unhappy, and that work is to put into action the power of reason. (1097b, 24-1098a, 4) Note please that he does not say that everyone must be a philosopher, nor even that human life is constituted by the activity of reason, but that our work is to bring the power of logos forward into action. Later, Aristotle makes explicit that the irrational impulses are no less human than reasoning is. (1111 b, 1-2) His point is that, as human beings, our desires need not be mindless and random, but can be transformed by thinking into choices, that is desires informed by deliberation. (1113a, 11) The characteristic human way of being-at-work is the threefold activity of seeing an end, thinking about means to it, and choosing an action. Responsible human action depends upon the combining of all the powers of the soul: perception, imagination, reasoning, and desiring. These are all things that are at work in us all the time. Good parental training does not produce them, or mold them, or alter them, but sets them free to be effective in action. This is the way in which, according to Aristotle, despite the contributions of parents, society, and nature, we are the co-authors of the active states of our own souls (1114b, 23-4).

2. The Mean

Now this discussion has shown that habit does make all the difference to our lives without being the only thing shaping those lives and without being the final form they take. The same discussion also points to a way to make some sense of one of the things that has always puzzled me most in the Ethics, the insistence that moral virtue is always in its own nature a mean condition. Quantitative relations are so far from any serious human situation that they would seem to be present only incidentally or metaphorically, but Aristotle says that "by its thinghood and by the account that unfolds what it is for it to be, virtue is a mean." (1107a, 7-8) This invites such hopeless shallowness as in the following sentences from a recent article in the journal Ancient Philosophy (Vol. 8, pp. 101-4): "To illustrate ...0 marks the mean (e.g. Courage); ...Cowardice is -3 while Rashness is 3...In our number language...'Always try to lower the absolute value of your vice.' " This scholar thinks achieving courage is like tuning in a radio station on an analog dial. Those who do not sink this low might think instead that Aristotle is praising a kind of mediocrity, like that found in those who used to go to college to get "gentlemen's C's." But what sort of courage could be found in these timid souls, whose only aim in life is to blend so well into their social surroundings that virtue can never be chosen in preference to a fashionable vice? Aristotle points out twice that every moral virtue is an extreme (1107a, 8-9, 22-4), but he keeps that observation secondary to an over-riding sense in which it is a mean.

Could there be anything at all to the notion that we hone in on a virtue from two sides? There is a wonderful image of this sort of thing in the novel Nop's Trials by Donald McCaig. The protagonist is not a human being, but a border collie named Nop. The author describes the way the dog has to find the balance point, the exact distance behind a herd of sheep from which he can drive the whole herd forward in a coherent mass. When the dog is too close, the sheep panic and run off in all directions; when he is too far back, the sheep ignore him, and turn in all directions to graze. While in motion, a good working dog keeps adjusting his pace to maintain the exact mean position that keeps the sheep stepping lively in the direction he determines. Now working border collies are brave, tireless, and determined. They have been documented as running more than a hundred miles in a day, and they love their work. There is no question that they display virtue, but it is not human virtue and not even of the same form. Some human activities do require the long sustained tension a sheep dog is always holding on to, an active state stretched to the limit, constantly and anxiously kept in balance. Running on a tightrope might capture the same flavor. But constantly maintained anxiety is not the kind of stable equilibrium Aristotle attributes to the virtuous human soul.

I think we may have stumbled on the way that human virtue is a mean when we found that habits were necessary in order to counteract other habits. This does accord with the things Aristotle says about straightening warped boards, aiming away from the worse extreme, and being on guard against the seductions of pleasure. (1109a, 30- b9) The habit of abstinence from bodily pleasure is at the opposite extreme from the childish habit of yielding to every immediate desire. Alone, either of them is a vice, according to Aristotle. The glutton, the drunkard, the person enslaved to every sexual impulse obviously cannot ever be happy, but the opposite extremes, which Aristotle groups together as a kind of numbness or denial of the senses (1107b, 8), miss the proper relation to bodily pleasure on the other side. It may seem that temperance in relation to food, say, depends merely on determining how many ounces of chocolate mousse to eat. Aristotle's example of Milo the wrestler, who needs more food than the rest of us do to sustain him, seems to say this, but I think that misses the point. The example is given only to show that there is no single action that can be prescribed as right for every person and every circumstance, and it is not strictly analogous even to temperance with respect to food. What is at stake is not a correct quantity of food but a right relation to the pleasure that comes from eating.

Suppose you have carefully saved a bowl of chocolate mousse all day for your mid-evening snack, and just as you are ready to treat yourself, a friend arrives unexpectedly to visit. If you are a glutton, you might hide the mousse until the friend leaves, or gobble it down before you open the door. If you have the opposite vice, and have puritanically suppressed in yourself all indulgence in the pleasures of food, you probably won't have chocolate mousse or any other treat to offer your visitor. If the state of your soul is in the mean in these matters, you are neither enslaved to nor shut out from the pleasure of eating treats, and can enhance the visit of a friend by sharing them. What you are sharing is incidentally the 6 ounces of chocolate mousse; the point is that you are sharing the pleasure, which is not found on any scale of measurement. If the pleasures of the body master you, or if you have broken their power only by rooting them out, you have missed out on the natural role that such pleasures can play in life. In the mean between those two states, you are free to notice possibilities that serve good ends, and to act on them.

It is worth repeating that the mean is not the 3 ounces of mousse on which you settled, since if two friends had come to visit you would have been willing to eat 2 ounces. That would not have been a division of the food but a multiplication of the pleasure. What is enlightening about the example is how readily and how nearly universally we all see that sharing the treat is the right thing to do. This is a matter of immediate perception, but it is perception of a special kind, not that of any one of the five senses, Aristotle says, but the sort by which we perceive that a triangle is the last kind of figure into which a polygon can be divided. (1142a, 28-30) This is thoughtful and imaginative perceiving, but it has to be perceived. The childish sort of habit clouds our sight, but the liberating counter-habit clears that sight. This is why Aristotle says that the person of moral stature, the spoudaios, is the one to whom things appear as they truly are. (1113a, 30-1) Once the earliest habits are neutralized, our desires are disentangled from the pressure for immediate gratification, we are calm enough to think, and most important, we can see what is in front of us in all its possibility. The mean state here is not a point on a dial that we need to fiddle up and down; it is a clearing in the midst of pleasures and pains that lets us judge what seems most truly pleasant and painful.

Achieving temperance toward bodily pleasures is, by this account, finding a mean, but it is not a simple question of adjusting a single varying condition toward the more or the less. The person who is always fighting the same battle, always struggling like the sheep dog to maintain the balance point between too much and too little indulgence, does not, according to Aristotle, have the virtue of temperance, but is at best selfrestrained or continent. In that case, the reasoning part of the soul is keeping the impulses reined in. But those impulses can slip the reins and go their own way, as parts of the body do in people with certain disorders of the nerves. (1102b, 14-22) Control in self-restrained people is an anxious, unstable equilibrium that will lapse whenever vigilance is relaxed. It is the old story of the conflict between the head and the emotions, never resolved but subject to truces. A soul with separate, self-contained rational and irrational parts could never become one undivided human being, since the parties would always believe they had divergent interests, and could at best compromise. The virtuous soul, on the contrary, blends all its parts in the act of choice.

This is arguably the best way to understand the active state of the soul that constitutes moral virtue and forms character. It is the condition in which all the powers of the soul are at work together, making it possible for action to engage the whole human being. The work of achieving character is a process of clearing away the obstacles that stand in the way of the full efficacy of the soul. Someone who is partial to food or drink, or to running away from trouble or to looking for trouble, is a partial human being. Let the whole power of the soul have its influence, and the choices that result will have the characteristic look that we call "courage" or "temperance" or simply "virtue." Now this adjective "characteristic" comes from the Greek word charactÍr, which means the distinctive mark scratched or stamped on anything, and which is apparently never used in the Nicomachean Ethics. In the sense of character of which we are speaking, the word for which is Íthos, we see an outline of the human form itself. A person of character is someone you can count on, because there is a human nature in a deeper sense than that which refers to our early state of weakness. Someone with character has taken a stand in that fully mature nature, and cannot be moved all the way out of it.

But there is also such a thing as bad character, and this is what Aristotle means by vice, as distinct from bad habits or weakness. It is possible for someone with full responsibility and the free use of intellect to choose always to yield to bodily pleasure or to greed. Virtue is a mean, first because it can only emerge out of the stand-off between opposite habits, but second because it chooses to take its stand not in either of those habits but between them. In this middle region, thinking does come into play, but it is not correct to say that virtue takes its stand in principle; Aristotle makes clear that vice is a principled choice that following some extreme path toward or away from pleasure is right. (1146b, 22-3) Principles are wonderful things, but there are too many of them, and exclusive adherence to any one of them is always a vice.

In our earlier example, the true glutton would be someone who does not just have a bad habit of always indulging the desire for food, but someone who has chosen on principle that one ought always to yield to it. In Plato's Gorgias, Callicles argues just that, about food, drink, and sex. He is serious, even though he is young and still open to argument. But the only principled alternative he can conceive is the denial of the body, and the choice of a life fit only for stones or corpses. (492E) This is the way most attempts to be serious about right action go astray. What, for example, is the virtue of a seminar leader? Is it to ask appropriate questions but never state an opinion? Or is it to offer everything one has learned on the subject of discussion? What principle should rule?--that all learning must come from the learners, or that without prior instruction no useful learning can take place? Is there a hybrid principle? Or should one try to find the mid-way point between the opposite principles? Or is the virtue some third kind of thing altogether?

Just as habits of indulgence always stand opposed to habits of abstinence, so too does every principle of action have its opposite principle. If good habituation ensures that we are not swept away by our strongest impulses, and the exercise of intelligence ensures that we will see two worthy sides to every question about action, what governs the choice of the mean? Aristotle gives this answer: "such things are among particulars, and the judgment is in the act of sense-perception." (1109b, 23-4) But this is the calmly energetic, thought-laden perception to which we referred earlier. The origin of virtuous action is neither intellect nor appetite, but is variously described as intellect through-and-through infused with appetite, or appetite wholly infused with thinking, or appetite and reason joined for the sake of something; this unitary source is called by Aristotle simply anthropos. (1139a, 34, b, S-7) But our thinking must contribute right reason (ho orthos logos) and our appetites must contribute rightdesire (hÍ orthÍ orexis) if the action is to have moral stature. (1114b, 29, 1139a, 24-6, 31-2) What makes them right can only be the something for the sake of which they unite, and this is what is said to be accessible only to sense perception. This brings us to the third word we need to think about.

3. Noble

Aristotle says plainly and repeatedly what it is that moral virtue is for the sake of, but the translators are afraid to give it to you straight. Most of them say it is the noble. One of them says it is the fine. If these answers went past you without even registering, that is probably because they make so little sense. To us, the word "noble" probably connotes some sort of high-minded naiveté, something hopelessly impractical. But Aristotle considers moral virtue the only practical road to effective action. The word "fine" is of the same sort but worse, suggesting some flimsy artistic soul who couldn't endure rough treatment, while Aristotle describes moral virtue as the most stable and durable condition in which we can meet all obstacles. The word the translators are afraid of is to kalon, the beautiful. Aristotle singles out as the distinguishing mark of courage, for example, that it is always "for the sake of the beautiful, for this is the end of virtue." (111 S b, 12-13) Of magnificence, or large-scale philanthropy, he says it is "for the sake of the beautiful, for this is common to the virtues." (1122 b, 78) What the person of good character loves with right desire and thinks of as an end with right reason must first be perceived as beautiful.

The Loeb translator explains why he does not use the word "beautiful" in the Nicomachean Ethics. He tells us to kalon has two different uses, and refers both to "(1) bodies well shaped and works of art ...well made, and (2) actions well done." (p. 6) But we have already noticed that Aristotle says the judgment of what is morally right belongs to sense-perception. And he explicitly compares the well made work of art to an act that springs from moral virtue. Of the former, people say that it is not possible add anything to it or take anything from it, and Aristotle says that virtue differs from art in that respect only in being more precise and better. (1106b, 10-15) An action is right in the same way a painting might get everything just right. Antigone contemplates in her imagination the act of burying her brother, and says "it would be a beautiful thing to die doing this." (Antigone, line 72) This is called "courage." Neoptolemus stops Philoctetes from killing Odysseus with the bow he has just returned, and says "neither for me nor for you is this a beautiful thing." (Philoctetes, line 1304) This is a recognition that the rightness of returning the bow would be spoiled if it were used for revenge. This is not some special usage of the Greek language, but one that speaks to us directly, if the translators let it. And it is not a kind of language that belongs only to poetic tragedy, since the tragedians find their subjects by recognizing human virtue in circumstances that are most hostile to it.

In the most ordinary circumstances, any mother might say to a misbehaving child, in plain English, "don't be so ugly." And any of us, parent, friend, or grudging enemy, might on occasion say to someone else, "that was a beautiful thing you did." Is it by some wild coincidence that twentieth-century English and fourth-century BC Greek link the same pair of uses under one word? Aristotle is always alert to the natural way that important words have more than one meaning. The inquiry in his Metaphysics is built around the progressive narrowing of the word "being" until its primary meaning is discovered. In the Physics the various senses of motion and change are played on like the keyboard of a piano, and serve to uncover the double source of natural activity. The inquiry into ethics is not built in this fashion; Aristotle asks about the way the various meanings of the good are organized, but he immediately drops the question, as being more at home in another sort of philosophic inquiry. (1096b, 26-32) It is widely claimed that Aristotle says there is no good itself, or any other form at all of the sort spoken of in Plato's dialogues. This is a misreading of any text of Aristotle to which it is referred. Here in the study of ethics it is a failure to see that the idea of the good is not rejected simply, but only held off as a question that does not arise as first for us. Aristotle praises Plato for understanding that philosophy does not argue from first principles but toward them. (1095a, 31-3)

But while Aristotle does not make the meanings of the good an explicit theme that shapes his inquiry, he nevertheless does plainly lay out its three highest senses, and does narrow down the three into two and indirectly into one. He tells us there are three kinds of good toward which our choices look, the pleasant, the beautiful, and the beneficial or advantageous. (1104b, 31-2) The last of these is clearly subordinate to the other two, and when the same issue comes up next, it has dropped out of the list. The goods sought for their own sake are said to be of only two kinds, the pleasant and the beautiful. (1110b, 9-12) That the beautiful is the primary sense of the good is less obvious, both because the pleasant is itself resolved into a variety of senses, and because a whole side of virtue that we are not considering in this lecture aims at the true, but we can sketch out some ways in which the beautiful emerges as the end of human action.

Aristotle's first description of moral virtue required that the one acting choose an action knowingly, out of a stable equilibrium of the soul, and for its own sake. The knowing in question turned out to be perceiving things as they are, as a result of the habituation that clears our sight. The stability turned out to come from the active condition of all the powers of the soul, in the mean position opened up by that same habituation, since it neutralized an earlier, opposite, and passive habituation to self-indulgence. In the accounts of the particular moral virtues, an action's being chosen for its own sake is again and again specified as meaning chosen for no reason other than that it is beautiful. In Book III, chapter 8, Aristotle refuses to give the name courageous to anyone who acts bravely for the sake of honor, out of shame, from experience that the danger is not as great as it seems, out of spiritedness or anger or the desire for revenge, or from optimism or ignorance. Genuinely courageous action is in no obvious way pleasant, and is not chosen for that reason, but there is according to Aristotle a truer pleasure inherent in it. It doesn't need pleasure dangled in front of it as an extra added attraction. Lasting and satisfying pleasure never comes to those who seek pleasure, but only to the philokalos, who looks past pleasure to the beautiful. (1099a, 15-17, 13)

In our earlier example of temperance, I think most of us would readily agree that the one who had his eye only the chocolate mousse found less pleasure than the one who saw that it would be a better thing to share it. And Aristotle does say explicitly that the target the temperate person looks to is the beautiful. (1119b, 15-17) But since there are three primary moral virtues, courage, temperance, and justice, it is surprising that in the whole of Book V, which discusses justice, Aristotle never mentions the beautiful. It must somehow be applicable, since he says it is common to all the moral virtues, but in that case it would seem that the account of justice could not be complete if it is not connected to the beautiful. I think this does happen, but in an unexpected way.

Justice seems to be not only a moral virtue, but in some pre-eminent way the moral virtue. And Aristotle says that there is a sense of the word in which the one we call "just" is the person who has all moral virtue, insofar as it affects other people. (1129b, 26-7) In spite of all this, I believe that Aristotle treats justice as something inherently inadequate, a condition of the soul that cannot ever achieve the end at which it aims. Justice concerns itself with the right distribution of rewards and punishments within a community. This would seem to be the chief aim of the lawmakers, but Aristotle says that they do not take justice as seriously as friendship. They accord friendship a higher moral stature than justice. (1155a, 23-4) It seems to me now that Aristotle does too, and that the discussion of friendship in Books VIII and IX replaces that of justice.

What is the purpose of reward and punishment? I take Aristotle's answer to be homonoia, the like-mindedness that allows a community to act in concord. For the sake of this end, he says, it is not good enough that people be just, while if they are friends they have no need to be just: (1155a, 24-9) So far, this sounds as though friendship is merely something advantageous for the social or political good, but Aristotle immediately adds that it is also beautiful. The whole account of friendship, you will recall, is structured around the threefold meaning of the good. Friendships are distinguished as being for use, for pleasure, or for love of the friend's character.

Repeatedly, after raising questions about the highest kind of friendship, Aristotle resolves them by looking to the beautiful: it is a beautiful thing to do favors for someone freely, without expecting a return (1163a, 1, 1168a, 10-13); even in cases of urgent necessity, when there is a choice about whom to benefit, one should first decide whether the scale tips toward the necessary or the beautiful thing (1165a, 4-5 ); to use money to support our parents is always more beautiful than to use it for ourselves (1165a, 22-4); someone who strives to achieve the beautiful in action would never be accused of being selfish (1168b, 25-8). These observations culminate in the claim that, "if all people competed for the beautiful, and strained to do the most beautiful things, everything people need in common, and the greatest good for each in particular, would be achieved ...for the person of moral stature will forego money, honor, and all the good things people fight over to achieve the beautiful for himself." (1169a, 8-11, 20-22) This does not mean that people can do without such things as money and honor, but that the distribution of such things takes care of itself when people take each other seriously and look to something higher.

The description of the role of the beautiful in moral virtue is most explicit in the discussion of courage, where the emphasis is on the great variety of things that resemble courage but fail to achieve it because they are not solely for the sake of the beautiful. That discussion is therefore mostly negative. We can now see that the discussion of justice was also of a negative character, since justice itself resembles the moral virtue called "friendship" without achieving it, again because it does not govern its action by looking to the beautiful. The discussion of friendship contains the largest collection of positive examples of actions that are beautiful. There is something of a tragic feeling to the account of courage, pointing to the extreme situation of war in which nothing might be left to choose but a beautiful death. But the account of friendship points to the healthy community, in which civil war and other conflicts are driven away by the choice of what is beautiful in life. (1155a, 24-7) By the end of the ninth book, there is no doubt that Aristotle does indeed believe in a primary sense of the good, at least in the human realm, and that the name of this highest good is the beautiful.

And it should be noticed that the beautiful is at work not only in the human realm. In De Anima, Aristotle argues that, while the soul moves itself in the act of choice, the ultimate source of its motion is the practical good toward which it looks, which causes motion while it is itself motionless. (433a, 29-30, b, 11-13) This structure of the motionless first mover is taken up in Book XII of the Metaphysics, where Aristotle argues that the order of the cosmos depends on such a source, which causes motion in the manner of something loved; he calls this source, as one of its names, "the beautiful," that which is beautiful not in seeming but in being. (1072a, 26-b, 4) Like Diotima in Plato's Symposium, Aristotle makes the beautiful the good itself.

A final word, on the fact that the beautiful in the Ethics is not an object of contemplation simply, but the source of action: In an article on the Poetics, I discussed the intimate connection of beauty with the experience of wonder. The sense of wonder seems to be the way of seeing which allows things to appear as what they are, since it holds off our tendencies to make things fit into theories or opinions we already hold, or use things for purposes that have nothing to do with them. But this is what Aristotle says repeatedly is the ultimate effect of moral virtue, that the one who has it sees truly and judges rightly, since only to someone of good character do the things that are beautiful appear as they truly are (1113 a, 29-35), that practical wisdom depends on moral virtue to make its aim right (1144a, 7-9), and that the eye of the soul that sees what is beautiful as the end or highest good of action gains its active state only with moral virtue (1144a, 26-33). It is only in the middle ground between habits of acting and between principles of action that the soul can allow right desire and right reason to make their appearance, as the direct and natural response of a free human being to the sight of the beautiful.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle, Metaphysics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Green Lion Press, 1999.
  • Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Focus Philosophical Library, Pullins Press, 2002.
  • Aristotle, On the Soul, Joe Sachs (trans.), Green Lion Press, 2001.
  • Aristotle, Poetics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Focus Philosophical Library, Pullins Press, 2006.
  • Aristotle, Physics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Rutgers U. P., 1995.

Author Information

Joe Sachs
St. John's College
U. S. A.

Evolutionary Ethics

Evolutionary ethics tries to bridge the gap between philosophy and the natural sciences by arguing that natural selection has instilled human beings with a moral sense, a disposition to be good. If this were true, morality could be understood as a phenomenon that arises automatically during the evolution of sociable, intelligent beings and not, as theologians or philosophers might argue, as the result of divine revelation or the application of our rational faculties. Morality would be interpreted as a useful adaptation that increases the fitness of its holders by providing a selective advantage. This is certainly the view of Edward O. Wilson, the "father" of sociobiology, who believes that "scientists and humanists should consider together the possibility that the time has come for ethics to be removed temporarily from the hands of the philosophers and biologicized" (Wilson, 1975: 27). The challenge for evolutionary biologists such as Wilson is to define goodness with reference to evolutionary theory and then explain why human beings ought to be good.

Table of Contents

  1. Key Figures and Key Concepts
    1. Charles Darwin
    2. Herbert Spencer
    3. The Is-Ought Problem
    4. The Naturalistic Fallacy
    5. Sociobiology
  2. Placement in Contemporary Ethical Theory
  3. Challenges for Evolutionary Ethics
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Key Figures and Key Concepts

a. Charles Darwin

The biologization of ethics started with the publication of The Descent of Man by Charles Darwin (1809-1882) in 1871. In this follow-up to On the Origin of Species, Darwin applied his ideas about evolutionary development to human beings. He argued that humans must have descended from a less highly organized form--in fact, from a "hairy, tailed quadruped ... inhabitant of the Old World" (Darwin, 1930: 231). The main difficulty Darwin saw with this explanation is the high standard of moral qualities apparent in humans. Faced with this puzzle, Darwin devoted a large chapter of the book to evolutionary explanations of the moral sense, which he argued must have evolved in two main steps.

First, the root for human morality lies in the social instincts (ibid. 232). Building on this claim by Darwin, today's biologists would explain this as follows. Sociability is a trait whose phylogenetic origins can be traced back to the time when birds "invented" brooding, hatching, and caring for young offspring. To render beings able to fulfill parental responsibilities required social mechanisms unnecessary at earlier stages of evolutionary history. For example, neither amoebae (which reproduce by division) nor frogs (which leave their tadpole-offspring to fend for themselves) need the social instincts present in birds. At the same time as facilitating the raising of offspring, social instincts counterbalanced innate aggression. It became possible to distinguish between "them" and "us" and aim aggression towards individuals that did not belong to one's group. This behavior is clearly adaptive in the sense of ensuring the survival of one's family.

Second, with the development of intellectual faculties, human beings were able to reflect on past actions and their motives and thus approve or disapprove of others as well as themselves. This led to the development of a conscience which became "the supreme judge and monitor" of all actions (ibid. 235). Being influenced by utilitarianism, Darwin believed that the greatest-happiness principle will inevitably come to be regarded as a standard for right and wrong (ibid. 134) by social beings with highly evolved intellectual capacities and a conscience.

Based on these claims, can Darwin answer the two essential questions in ethics? First, how can we distinguish between good and evil? And second, why should we be good? If all his claims were true, they would indeed support answers to the above questions. Darwin's distinction between good and evil is identical with the distinction made by hedonistic utilitarians. Darwin accepts the greatest-happiness principle as a standard of right and wrong. Hence, an action can be judged as good if it improves the greatest happiness of the greatest number, by either increasing pleasure or decreasing pain. And the second question--why we should be good--does not pose itself for Darwin with the same urgency as it did, for instance, for Plato (Thrasymachus famously asked Socrates in the Republic why the strong, who are not in need of aid, should accept the Golden Rule as a directive for action). Darwin would say that humans are biologically inclined to be sympathetic, altruistic, and moral as this proved to be an advantage in the struggle for existence (ibid. 141).

b. Herbert Spencer

The next important contribution to evolutionary ethics was by Herbert Spencer (1820-1903), the most fervent defender of that theory and the creator of the theory of Social Darwinism. Spencer's theory can be summarized in three steps. As did Darwin, Spencer believed in the theory of hedonistic utilitarianism as proposed by Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill. In his view, gaining pleasure and avoiding pain directs all human action. Hence, moral good can be equated with facilitating human pleasure. Second, pleasure can be achieved in two ways, first by satisfying self-regarding impulses and second by satisfying other-regarding impulses. This means that eating one's favorite food and giving food to others are both pleasurable experiences for humans. Third, mutual cooperation between humans is required to coordinate self- and other-regarding impulses, which is why humans develop principles of equity to bring altruistic and egoistic traits into balance (Fieser, 2001, 214).

However, Spencer did not become known for his theory of mutual cooperation. On the contrary, his account of Social Darwinism is contentious to date because it is mostly understood as "an apology for some of the most vile social systems that humankind has ever known," for instance German Nazism (Ruse, 1995: 228). In short, Spencer elevated alleged biological facts (struggle for existence, natural selection, survival of the fittest) to prescriptions for moral conduct (ibid. 225). For instance, he suggested that life is a struggle for human beings and that, in order for the best to survive, it is necessary to pursue a policy of non-aid for the weak: "to aid the bad in multiplying, is, in effect, the same as maliciously providing for our descendants a multitude of enemies" (Spencer, 1874: 346). Spencer's philosophy was widely popular, particularly in North America in the 19th century, but declined significantly in the 20th century.

Which answers could he give to the two essential questions in ethics? How can we distinguish between good and evil and why should we be good? Spencer's answer to question one is identical to Darwin’s (see above) as they both supported hedonistic utilitarianism. However, his answer to question two is interesting, if untenable. Spencer alleged that evolution equaled progress for the better (in the moral sense of the word) and that anything which supported evolutionary forces would therefore be good (Maxwell, 1984: 231). The reasoning behind this was that nature shows us what is good by moving towards it; and hence, "evolution is a process which, in itself, generates value" (Ruse, 1995: 231). If evolution advances the moral good, we ought to support it out of self-interest. Moral good was previously identified with universal human pleasure and happiness by Spencer. If the evolutionary process directs us towards this universal pleasure, we have an egoistic reason for being moral, namely that we want universal happiness. However, to equate development with moral progress for the better was a major value judgement which cannot be held without further evidence, and most evolutionary theorists have given up on the claim (Ruse, 1995: 233; Woolcock, 1999: 299). It also is subject to more conceptual objections, namely deriving "ought" from "is," and committing the naturalistic fallacy.

c. The Is-Ought Problem

The first philosopher who persistently argued that normative rules cannot be derived from empirical facts was David Hume (1711-1776) (1978: 469):

In every system of morality, which I have hitherto met with, I have always remark'd, that the author proceeds for some time in the ordinary way of reasoning, and establishes the being of a God or makes observations concerning human affairs; when of a sudden I am surpriz'd to find, that instead of the usual copulations of propositions, is, and is not, I meet with no proposition that is not connected with an ought, or an ought not. This change is imperceptible; but is, however, of the last consequence.

It is this unexplained, imperceptible change from "is" to "ought" which Hume deplores in moral systems. To say what is the case and to say what ought to be the case are two unrelated matters, according to him. On the one hand, empirical facts do not contain normative statements, otherwise they would not be purely empirical. On the other hand, if there are no normative elements in the facts, they cannot suddenly surface in the conclusions because a conclusion is only deductively valid if all necessary information is present in the premises.

How do Darwin and Spencer derive "ought" from "is"? Let us look at Darwin first, using an example which he could have supported.

  1. Child A is dying from starvation.
  2. The parents of child A are not in a position to feed their child.
  3. The parents of child A are very unhappy that their child is dying from starvation.
  4. Therefore, fellow humans ought morally to provide food for child A.

Darwin (1930: 234) writes that "happiness is an essential part of the general good." Therefore, those who want to be moral ought to promote happiness, and hence, in the above case, provide food. However, the imperceptible move from "is" to "ought" which Hume found in moral systems, is also present in this example. Thus, Darwin derives ought from is when he moves from the empirical fact of unhappiness to the normative claim of a duty to relieve unhappiness.

The same can be said for Spencer whose above argument about the survival of the fittest could be represented as follows:

  1. Natural selection will ensure the survival of the fittest.
  2. Person B is dying from starvation because he is ill, old, and poor.
  3. Therefore, fellow humans ought to morally avoid helping person B so that the survival of the fittest is guaranteed.

Even if both premises were shown to be true, it does not follow that we ought to morally support the survival of the fittest. An additional normative claim equating survival skills with moral goodness would be required to make the argument tenable. Again, this normative part of the argument is not included in the premises. Hence, Spencer also derives "ought" from "is." Thomas Huxley (1906: 80) objects to evolutionary ethics on these grounds when he writes:

The thief and the murderer follow nature just as much as the philantropist. Cosmic evolution may teach us how the good and the evil tendencies of man may have come about; but, in itself, it is incompetent to furnish any better reason why what we call good is preferable to what we call evil than we had before.

d. The Naturalistic Fallacy

But evolutionary ethics was not only attacked by those who supported Hume's claim that normative statements cannot be derived from empirical facts. A related argument against evolutionary ethics was voiced by British philosopher G.E. Moore (1873-1958). In 1903, he published a ground-breaking book, Principia Ethica, which created one of the most challenging problems for evolutionary ethics: the "naturalistic fallacy." According to Michael Ruse (1995), when dealing with evolutionary ethics, "it has been enough for the student to murmur the magical phrase 'naturalistic fallacy,' and then he or she can move on to the next question, confident of having gained full marks thus far on the exam" (p. 223). So, what is the naturalistic fallacy and why does it pose a problem for evolutionary ethics?

Moore was interested in the definition of "good" and particularly in whether the property good is simple or complex. Simple properties, according to Moore, are indefinable as they cannot be described further using more basic properties. Complex properties, on the other hand, can be defined by outlining their basic properties. Hence, "yellow" cannot be defined in terms of its constituent parts, whereas "colored" can be explained further as it consists of several individual colors.

"Good," according to Moore, is a simple property which cannot be described using more basic properties. Committing the naturalistic fallacy is attempting to define "good" with reference to other natural, i.e. empirically verifiable, properties. This understanding of "good" creates serious problems for both Darwin and Spencer. Following Bentham and Mill, both identify moral goodness with "pleasure." This means they commit the naturalistic fallacy as good and pleasant are not identical. In addition, Spencer identifies goodness with "highly evolved," committing the naturalistic fallacy again. (Both Moore's claim in itself as well as his criticism of evolutionary ethics can be attacked, but this would fall outside the scope of this entry.)

e. Sociobiology

Despite the continuing challenge of the naturalistic fallacy, evolutionary ethics has moved on with the advent of sociobiology. In 1948, at a conference in New York, scientists decided to initiate new interdisciplinary research between zoologists and sociologists. "Sociobiology" was the name given to the new discipline aiming to find universally valid regularities in the social behavior of animals and humans. Emphasis was put on the study of biological, i.e. non-cultural, behavior. The field did, however, not get off the ground until Edward Wilson published his Sociobiology: The New Synthesis in 1975. According to Wilson (1975: 4), "sociobiology is defined as the systematic study of the biological basis of all social behavior."

In Wilson's view, sociobiology makes philosophers, at least temporarily, redundant, when it comes to questions of ethics (see quote in introduction). He believes that ethics can be explained biologically when he writes (ibid. 3, emphasis added):

The hypothalamus and limbic system ... flood our consciousness with all the emotions - hate, love, guilt, fear, and others – that are consulted by ethical philosophers who wish to intuit the standards of good and evil. What, we are then compelled to ask, made the hypothalamus and the limbic system? They evolved by natural selection. That simple biological statement must be pursued to explain ethics.

Ethics, following this understanding, evolved under the pressure of natural selection. Sociability, altruism, cooperation, mutual aid, etc. are all explicable in terms of the biological roots of human social behavior. Moral conduct aided the long-term survival of the morally inclined species of humans. According to Wilson (ibid. 175), the prevalence of egoistic individuals will make a community vulnerable and ultimately lead to the extinction of the whole group. Mary Midgley agrees. In her view, egoism pays very badly in genetic terms, and a "consistently egoistic species would be either solitary or extinct" (Midgley, 1980: 94).

Wilson avoids the naturalistic fallacy in Sociobiology by not equating goodness with another natural property such as pleasantness, as Darwin did. This means that he does not give an answer to our first essential question in ethics. What is good? However, like Darwin he gives an answer to question two. Why should we be moral? Because we are genetically inclined to be moral. It is a heritage of earlier times when less morally inclined and more morally inclined species came under pressure from natural selection. Hence, we do not need divine revelation or strong will to be good; we are simply genetically wired to be good. The emphasis in this answer is not on the should, as it is not our free will which makes us decide to be good but our genetic heritage.

One of the main problems evolutionary ethics faces is that ethics is not a single field with a single quest. Instead, it can be separated into various areas, and evolutionary ethics might not be able to contribute to all of them. Let us therefore look at a possible classification for evolutionary ethics, which maps it on the field of traditional ethics, before concluding with possible criticisms.

2. Placement in Contemporary Ethical Theory

For philosophy students, ethics is usually divided into three areas: metaethics, normative ethical theory, and applied ethics. Metaethics looks for possible foundations of ethics. Are there any moral facts out there from which we can deduce our moral theories? Normative ethical theories suggest principles or sets of principles to distinguish morally good from morally bad actions. Applied ethics looks at particular moral issues, such as euthanasia or bribery.

However, this classification is not adequate to accommodate evolutionary ethics in its entirety. Instead, a different three-fold distinction of ethics seems appropriate: descriptive ethics, normative ethics, and metaethics. Descriptive ethics outlines ethical beliefs as held by various people and tries to explain why they are held. For instance, almost all human cultures believe that incest is morally wrong. This belief developed, it could be argued, because it provides a survival advantage to the group that entertains it. Normative ethical theories develop standards to judge which actions are good and which actions are bad. The standard as defended by evolutionary ethics would be something like "Actions that increase the long-term capacity of survival in evolutionary terms are good and actions that decrease this capacity are bad." However, the field has not yet established itself credibly in normative ethics. Consequentialism, deontology, virtue ethics, and social contracts still dominate debates. This is partly due to the excesses of Social Darwinism but also due to the unintuitive nature of the above or similar standards. Evolutionary ethics has been more successful in providing interesting answers in metaethics. Michael Ruse (1995: 250), for instance, argues that morality is a "collective illusion of the genes, bringing us all in.... We need to believe in morality, and so, thanks to our biology, we do believe in morality. There is no foundation "out there" beyond human nature."

Descriptive ethics seems, as yet, the most interesting area for evolutionary ethics, a topic particularly suitable for anthropological and sociological research. Which ethical beliefs do people hold and why? But in all three areas, challenges are to be faced.

3. Challenges for Evolutionary Ethics

The following are some lingering challenges for evolutionary ethics:

  • How can a trait that was developed under the pressure of natural selection explain moral actions that go far beyond reciprocal altruism or enlightened self-interest? How can, for instance, the action of Maximilian Kolbe be explained from a biological point of view? (Kolbe was a Polish priest who starved himself to death in a concentration camp to rescue a fellow prisoner.)
  • Could not human beings have moved beyond their biological roots and transcended their evolutionary origins, in which case they would be able to formulate goals in the pursuit of goodness, beauty, and truth that "have nothing to do directly with survival, and which may at times militate against survival?" (O'Hear, 1997: 203).
  • Morality is universal, whereas biologically useful altruism is particular favoring the family or the group over others. "Do not kill" does not only refer to one's own son, but also to the son of strangers. How can evolutionary ethics cope with universality?
  • Normative ethics aims to be action-guiding. How could humans ever judge an action to be ensuring long-term survival? (This is a practical rather than conceptual problem for evolutionary ethics.)
  • Hume's "is-ought" problem still remains a challenge for evolutionary ethics. How can one move from "is" (findings from the natural sciences, including biology and sociobiology) to "ought"?
  • Similarly, despite the length of time that has passed since the publication of Principia Ethica, the challenge of the "naturalistic fallacy" remains.

Evolutionary ethics is, on a philosopher's time-scale, a very new approach to ethics. Though interdisciplinary approaches between scientists and philosophers have the potential to generate important new ideas, evolutionary ethics still has a long way to go.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Darwin, Charles (1871, 1930) The Descent of Man, Watts & Co., London.
  • Fieser, James (2001) Moral Philosophy through the Ages, Mayfield Publishing Company, Mountain View California), Chapter 12 "Evolutionary Ethics."
  • Hume, David (1740, 1978) A Treatise of Human Nature, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Maxwell, Mary (1984) Human Evolution: A Philosophical Anthropology, Croom Helm, London.
  • Midgley, Mary (1980) Beast and Man: The Roots of Human Nature, Methuen, London.
  • O'Hear, Anthony (1997) Beyond Evolution: Human Nature and the Limits of Evolutionary Explanation, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Ruse, Michael (1995) Evolutionary Naturalism, Routledge, London.
  • Spencer, Herbert (1874) The Study of Sociology, Williams & Norgate, London.
  • Wilson, Edward O. (1975) Sociobiology: The New Synthesis, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts.
  • Woolcock, Peter G. (1999) "The Case Against Evolutionary Ethics Today," in: Maienschein, Jane and Ruse, Michael (eds) Biology and the Foundation of Ethics, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, pp. 276-306.

Author Information

Doris Schroeder
Lancaster University, United Kingdom

Ethics and Phenomenology

Phenomenology is, generally speaking, a discipline that examines questions of metaphysics and epistemology. Insofar as ethics is usually seen as a topic apart from metaphysics and epistemology, it is thus not typically addressed by philosophers in the phenomenological tradition. However, there are important areas of overlap between ethics, metaphysics and epistemology, which may be fruitful points of departure for exploring a phenomenologically-oriented notion of ethics. In particular, metaphysics and epistemology seek to consider the validity of, among other ideas, analysis and wonder. An exploration of analysis and wonder can reveal the importance of ethics in this context. Once we have seen what follows from this standpoint, further consideration of ethics in terms of engineering will show how this standpoint can inform upon the world of praxis.

Table of Contents

  1. Theoretical Concerns
    1. Ethics Underlies Wonder and Analysis
    2. War
    3. Hospitals
    4. Ethics of Integration
    5. People
  2. Tying Phenomenological Ethics to the World
    1. Overview
    2. Human Factors Engineering
    3. Phenomenology: Brentano
    4. Phenomenology: Edmund Husserl
    5. Phenomenology and Ergonomics: Parallels
    6. Phenomenology and Ergonomics: Enter Ethics
    7. Ethics as Homological
  3. References and Further Reading
    1. Theory
    2. Tying Phenomenological Ethics to the World

1. Theoretical Concerns

a. Ethics Underlies Wonder and Analysis

Ethics can be seen as the foundation of wonder and analytic thought. First, existentialists accept wonder and deemphasize analysis, though phenomenologists tend to be more open to wonder and analytic thinking. Logical positivists and linguistic analysts see wonder as reducible to logic. Existentialists and phenomenologists are comfortable with ethics associated with wonder and analysis. Positivists and analysts deny ethics as an irreducible field of study. Ethicists would look at wonder to see if people need drugs in order to achieve states of euphoria or peace. Additionally, ethicists would take the same view about computers and analytic method.

In both instances, the question of ethics enters concerning more than the validity of wonder and analysis in the traditional philosophical sense (Kazanjian, 80; Buber, p. 11). Traditionally, existentialists and phenomenologists see wonder as revealing what "is." Analysis has almost no place in much of existentialism, and varying degrees of validity in phenomenology. Traditionally, linguistic analysts and logical positivists see nothing to be gained with wonder. Reality is language, and is to be analyzed, never something about which to wonder.

Ethics brings in a deeper issue in both instances. Even if wonder alone is valid, ought people use drugs to feel a sense of awe? Even if analysis alone can give access to reality, ought people simply resot to computers, the higher the speed the better, to understand what is?

Existential and phenomenological thinkers tell us that awe or wonder is the basis of analysis, or as pure wonder, may stand alone without cognition. Ethicists may argue that awe or wonder is a human trait and ought not require or involve drugs and surgical stimulation of the brain to induce a sense of wonder (Campbell, p. 163). Awe is basically the social, intersubjective reality of living in the world. Phenomenology calls the world the lived world instead of just the material, quantifiable world. This wonder is consciousness in the unaltered state. In this unaltered state, wonder is part of normal, lived, reality or existence.

Ethicists would say that linguistic analysis or logical positivism changes or distorts reality. Drugs and brain stimulation are not lived reality. They develop a state of artificial awe or wonder. If the unaltered mind uses logic alone to access reality, it may mean altering reality from what ought be to what artificially exists. If the person uses mind altering drugs to achieve awe or wonder, then the awe or wonder itself is altered, artificial, and unlived. We then see not the lived world, but the artificial world.

Phenomenology says we should not excarnate or take analysis out of the lived world. Phenomenological ethicists would say we should not excarnate wonder itself from the lived world. Thus, phenomenologists and existentialists would be medically, pharmaceutically, or biologically excarnating wonder or awe from the lived world, even if they refute positivism and analytics' portrayal of awe or wonder as wrong and insist on wonder or awe as revealing reality. The ethical position becomes a sociological view (Bryant, p. 1).

Paul Ricoeur (p. 217) looks at Cartesian dualism and says that we must overcome its excarnating of objectivity from the body. Non-biochemically, Ricoeur is criticizing Cartesian dualism for ignoring the embodiment of the objective. He is insisting that objectification must be done within the context of the lived world. We analyze the lived world or reduce it to quantities within the general framework of awe or wonder. Ricoeur's approach suggests that even logical positivism and linguistic analysis needs to look at the problem of excarnation. These movements are in the same category as Cartesian dualism when they consider analysis or reduction as without wonder, or devoid of the lived world.

The difference between logical positivism and analytic philosophy on the one hand, and Cartesian dualism on the other, rests with their views of reality. Dualism sees mind and body, or objectivity and subjectivity, as both real and valid. The problem is how to relate them. Positivism and analytic thinking argue that the lived world, subjectivity, wonder, awe, and so on do not exist as irreducible reality. They are totally reducible to the simples of fact.

Ricoeurian thinking contrasts with Cartesian dualism and with positivism and analytic philosophy by saying all three movements should see themselves as having wrongly excarnated object from the lived world. An ethics approach to wonder, however, goes deeper than Ricoeur. The ethicist would insist that we cannot justify wonder for the sake of wonder. We need to look at how we approach wonder or awe. Saying that the lived world and wonder are important is not sufficient. Arguing against positivist and analytic reductionism of wonder to facts is only partly correct. How we define the biochemical context of wonder is critical.

In ethics, we may wonder by being conscious and not taking drugs to alter the brain. People look around them, or they inquire, or meditate, and feel it crucial to feel a sense of wonder that beings "are." We wonder by ourselves, without bio-physiological intervention. Indeed, we do not need to take an aspirin or other legal medication to feel as sense of relaxation, calm, or rest. Beyond this, ethics says we ought not feel it important or in any way justified to take any illegal drugs that might induce a "high." The biochemical high or awe is indeed a biochemical reduction or analytic approach to wonder. This approach would assume that the state of wonder is primarily, perhaps exclusively, a chemical reaction within the brain, and has little to do with normal, non-biochemical experiences of the lived world. In other words, the biochemical approach to wonder suggests that we wonder not through existing, but primarily through changing the chemistry of the brain.

Ethics might call the biochemical approach to wonder as biochemical, pharmaceutical, or otherwise physiological positivism or analysis. Ironically and unfortunately, this becomes serious to the point where no real inquiry, not even traditional logical positivism and analytic thinking is possible. An ethicist might ask us to look at a piece of analytic literature or philosophy. We see symbols, diagrams, and virtually mathematical methods for attempting to determine resolutions to questions and problems. The analytic thinker, the positivist, would argue that they are coming near to solving issues, and that these solutions or clarifications reveal a reality devoid of wonder.

The ethics approach notes that these analytic and positivist thinkers are consciously engaging in intellectually work. They converse with each other, perhaps argumentatively with existentialists and phenomenologists, but always are participating in some kind of control over what they are doing. Their brains are functioning without medication or alteration. Now, the ethicists will point out, consider the biochemically activated phenomenologist or existentialist. In other words, we no longer just speaking of the positivist and analytic thinker inquiring without drugs. We are no longer speaking of positivists and analytic thinkers trying to totally reduce wonder to facts in terms of normal, not medicated activity. What the ethicist criticizes is the phenomenologist or existentialist who is defending wonder through druges. This person is criticizing positivism and analysis for trying to totally non-biochemically reduce wonder or awe to atomism. Yet, the phenomenologist and existentialist is defending irreducibility by feeling wonder, perhaps even attempting writing if that is possible, by consuming biochemicals which will induce the sense of oneness or awe (Eliade, p. 31).

In effect, the phenomenologist or existentialist has become a de facto positivist or analytic thinker. The phenomenologist or existentialist becomes a biochemical phenomenologist or existentialist, totally reducing the chemistry of the brain, body, and lived world to atoms and chemical reactions. If it is possible, the ethicist calls this positivistic or analytic phenomenology or existentialism. On the other hand, for clarification, the ethicist might use another term: biochemical phenomenology or existentialism.

b. War

What of the analytic thinker or positivist using computers for their approaches? Ethics would point to the efforts by analytic thinkers during World War II to crack Hitler's Enigma Machine code. The machine worked strictly through symbols. Codes are symbols. During WWII the codes were relatively complex, but speed was crucial in breaking them. Today, and in the future, with cryptology becoming increasingly sophisticated, codes become more complex, and the speed required to break them more crucial.

Positivists and analysts would insist that their philosophy requires respect, and faster computers. Ethicists would argue that we need a better world where criminals and dictators are minimized, and their powers decapitated. Having the computer capabilities of speedier problem-solving does not "solve" the problem in its widest sense. The problem in its widest sense is that people, usually the leaders, go bad and make evil things happen in the world. When governments ignore the rise of evil, they usually invite international catastrophes such as the Second World War. As the war occurs, and as the innocent attempt to now fight and defeat the enemy, many on the side of the innocent take pride in their technical efforts.

Technical abilities helped our side win against Hitler in his efforts to communicate through codes. None of this would have had to occur if we had kept him from rising to power in the first place. His rise to power, and the unethical ways we ignored his ascension were key to the disaster of the Second World War. We ignored his actions against Jews and non-Jews. This ignorance was unethical. We sat back and did nothing.

Toward the end, we began panicking and wondered how to solve problems to end the war. One major answer was to break his coding abilities. Fortunately, we broke his code, and this helped us win the war.

Today, intelligence agencies are increasingly positivistic in their coding/decoding efforts. Computers are the foundations of coding/decoding. Speed is paramount. We spend money, lots of it, in developing ways of surreptitiously monitoring telecommunications to determine what potential terrorists are saying. Technology is advancing rapidly in our endeavors to translate foreign and English conversations to determine whether speakers are planning attacks.

Forgotten in all this rush to technologize existence, society ignores the ethical grounds of analysis and computers (Stine, 141). We forget that analysis is embodied in wonder, and that thinking and wonder involve the ethical orientation. Are we ignoring the poor, the economically and socially deprived, the underprivileged? We no doubt are ignoring the impoverished. Then, in the event that the impoverished seek ways of retaliating, we suddenly seeks technical ways of speedier discovery of the terrorists' plots.

Even when terrorists are wealthy, we seek to look the other way instead of considering their moral deviancy and their ongoing hatred of humanity, especially of the West. We let this hatred grow, assuming that we do not initially deny it. As their hatred grows, it can mushroom into attacks against the West or even people in other cultures. Only then, in post 9/11 fashion, do we react and seek the speediest computers to analyze terrorist activities and conversations.

Ethics is derived from ethos or people. Any human activity must be seen within the social context. Thinking and wonder are among the fundamental human activities. Relegating cognition to the sum total of data becomes anti-human; similarly, relegating wonder to the realm of intravenous or other methods of drug intake is no longer a human activity. The ethos orientation of cognition means that thought, contrary to what Descartes said, is embodied and of social perspective. Cognition is never disembodied. To disembody cognition is to commit two wrongs.

One wrong is to seek cognition as devoid of awe. This makes thought sterile and dehumanizing. The second wrong is to see disembodied cognition as part of a technology where speed is the only way to resolve problems and answer questions.

Awe or wonder is the pre-cognitive requisite of the cognitive. Yet, ethics notes that we cannot stop there. Wonder cannot be an end in itself. If wonder is derived from a natural, non-drug induced sequence whereby we simply wonder that things "are," then we are practicing true awe. Once we take drugs or otherwise stimulate the brain to induce wonder, than the wonder is unethical. It is mechanical rather than emerging from ethos.

c. Hospitals

Take the example of a hospital's intensive care unit. Patients are put on a respirator to help them breathe. They may also be put on intravenous feeding so that the body can be "fed" nutrients mechanically instead of taking in food through the mouth. In time, however, society believes that such patients may be retained on such mechanical devices only if their physical conditions warrant such technologization. The purpose of life is for the patient to be helped toward normalcy. In this case, the patient must be helped to leave the hospital and eat and breathe, and so on, on their own.

The objective of life, of the hospital, is never to merely have the patients remain in intensive care, or even in the hospital. People need to be active in daily life, eating, breathing, and so on on their own. To eat and breathe on their own means dining and respiring as part of society, with one's own bodily abilities. Food is irreducible to nutrients. Breathing is irreducible to oxygen intake. Food and respiration emerge from the ethos, from the ethical. As biological as eating and breathing, they are not merely physical processes.

For example, the nervous person, the seriously emotionally troubled individual, will have difficulty eating and breathing. Human activity such as eating and breathing are as much part of the ethos or ethical, as they are physical, neurochemical, and so on. Indeed, eating disorders such as those resulting in being overweight, imply reducing food to merely physical entities being "put into the mouth." Eating does not mean simply stuffing the mouth, eating quickly, or any other physical process. Dining is a cultural, ethical process.

Similarly, we do not just respire by hyperventilating. We breathe by inhaling and exhaling normally, often unconsciously. Perons inhaling too fast may be suffering from an emotional problem, or perhaps physical difficulty. Persons inhaling and exhaling too fast are behaving unethically, anti-ethos or different from normal human activity.

We can say the same about wonder and analysis. Wonder is something we sense under normal human conditions without mechanical assistance. Drugs ought not play part of wonder.

Analysis is an activity in which we participate without the aid of computers, and hopefully within the context of wonder. To think analytically is to take apart. But to spend our time only taking apart means that we are simply assuming that words, pictures, behavior, and so on are only to be taken apart and never appreciated as products of the ethos or community. Taking apart ought mean that something was initially a whole. That wholeness cannot be violated. If we emphasize the taking apart aspect of existence, and reject or ignore the synthetic and the wonderful, we have relegated existence to a form of hospitalization, to a form of the intensive care unit.

Existence is not meant to be only analyzed, and it is not meant to be only wondered. Ethos means that analysis and wonder go hand in hand. Analysis and wonder are not mutually exclusive. We never merely analyze without some wonder, and never wonder by merely mechanical means. Both analysis and wonder reflect an ethical, social, cultural dimension.

Feminism can be helpful here. Feminists argue that nothing written is ever totally objective, and devoid of the cultural. Look at books. Their authors are not just "authorities," but traditionally have been white males. Their subject matter, too, have typically ignored injustices toward women. Sexism means that we have looked at women simply as reducible to anatomy, and never as human beings. Ethics means that women are human beings, irreducible to physical characteristics.

Racial theory can also help. Racism has meant that authorities writing books have been white males. But the ethical thrust of the women's’ movement and racial justice has attempted to bring about a better, ethos oriented vision. We now have books and articles written by women, and by nonwhite males. Authors are not just authors. They are a racial-gender-human continuum. No author is the sum total of racial, religious, biological, and other parts. Every author is first of all a human being.

Wonder and analysis, then, are irreducible to mechanical identification. Persons need to be able to wonder with only their mind and body, in awe of the universe or of any particular event. They need only to analyze within the context of this natural wonder, and with computers only on a limited scale.

Ethics does not demand the exclusion of computers from society. The ethos orientation requires only that computing, speed, technology, and other quantification occur within the context of a healthy environment. The idea of proactivity or prevention is important here.

Proactivity means we need to prevent rather than react to bad events. Before illness strikes, we need to monitor physical and other conditions resulting in disease. Ethics means we ought not ignore health dangers, and then react medically, physically, surgically, to "solve" unhealthy situations. Drugs, whether over the counter or prescription, do not need to take the place of a healthy lifestyle and diet. People might need to depend on drugs as they age and their body deteriorates. Even then, they must take drugs only by doctor's orders, and never simply because the drugs are there.

The preventative, proactive approach to health includes habits of proper diet, exercise, monitoring stress, wearing clothes appropriate to the season, air conditioning during the summer and heat during the winter. These measures and lifestyles help insure that people will not get ill to the extent that they can have some reasonable control over life. Illness can and will come under many circumstances. Viruses, bacteria, many forms of sickness will emerge regardless of what we do to prevent illness.

When illness does come, we need to take a look at the best ways of curing what we have, and returning to a relative healthy state. Physicians may often examine patients and tell them than rest, proper diet, the drinking of fluids, and so on, will probably help bring the patients back to health. Not all diseases require medication. Additionally not all diseases require surgery. Even broken bones may not require cutting the patient. In time, many bones will heal correctly if their break is not in a physical position to cause deformity when healed.

Medicine, then, often seeks to prevent illness through a healthy lifestyle. When medical treatment is needed, pills are often preferable to surgery. Similar approaches are sought by ethicists for awe and analysis.

Wonder and analytic thinking are never mutually exclusive. Existence does not consist of wonder devoid of analysis, or analysis and rational-sensory approaches lacking awe. Most importantly, phenomenological ethics means that wonder and analysis are not to be merely the ends in themselves. We cannot say that because we are analyzing within the context of wonder, we are therefore being ethical, appropriately intellectual and properly in awe.

The states of awe and analysis are human states. They are irreducible to mechanical, physical, neurophysiological methods. Before we consider being in awe as a context for being analytical, we need to realize the need for being ethical, social, humane. Ethics is more than doing right and avoiding wrong in daily activity, business ventures, and the professions. Ethical behavior is basic to cognitive efforts to understand reality. The drug culture of the 1960s assumed that achieving a "high" was very important, but could not be reached until persons smoked pot or did hard drugs to alter the mind.

Similarly, people who believe in the rational approach to existence frequently misinterpret rationalism, logic, calculation, and speed. They too often assume that the logical or rational sequences are only sequences depending on speed. Their view is that speed is fundamental, and therefore the faster a sequence the better. From that view, the quicker we gather and understand greater numbers of variables or parts of the problem, the better our solution.

An unethical view of problem solving involves quick technical solutions to a given problem. A problem can be small or large. Instead of asking ourselves whether the problem is real or not, we frequently tell ourselves that speedy solutions are the answer. For example, take urban crime. We see robbers, burglars, car thieves. We hear of homicides and arsonists. Our typical approach is to assume that crime is crime, and its solution is a nonsocial, purely professional response from the police. The more police the better. The faster our calls are answered, and the quicker the police arrive at the scene, the better we feel that the problem of criminality is being solved.

This unethical view says that more crime we have, the more and faster police response we need. That view also suggests that the faster we get fingerprints and identify the wrongdoer, the more our society is progressing. Our emphasis is on speed, imprisonment or worse, technology, and other mechanical forms of reaction.

The ethical approach is fundamentally different. We would give opportunities to young people in order to attract them to productive lives outside crime. Families need strengthening, discipline must be practiced and taught, neighborhoods aware of wrongdoing, parental responsibility required. Our social institutions must be upheld. Churches, social groups, schools, governmental organizations, hospitals, and all businesses will need to work together. The police are there, but cannot be the only people combating crime. Technology ought be there, but only within the context of the social structures.

Society ought not ignore the social conditions and then go after the criminals arising as a result of deteriorating cultural situations. Culture is the not only contributor to crime. Some people simply may be born trouble makers. A weak social structure lets them do as they please until it is too late. Simply waiting for people to become criminals, then going after them, arresting, taking them to trail, and locking them up are the mechanical ways of recidivism.

The ethical approach attempt to return the criminal to society through rehabilitation when initial parenting or habilitation has failed. We cannot just let young people grow up doing as they please, and then throw the book at them when they go wrong. Society seems to like the mechanical approach to most things. In medicine and health, we increase emergency rooms. In law enforcement, we want more and faster police. Education becomes a mechanical method of learning from computers. Transportation develops into a way of speedier, aircraft, and automobiles even if we need to build bigger airports, and destroy ecology with more highways. Information becomes merely a commodity where we transmit data and receive it with greater efficiency. In more and areas, technology and rapidity of getting something or someone from here to there becomes paramount. Ethically, medicine must involve better health habits, law enforcement better homes, love, and discipline, learning a matter of student teacher interaction, travel a matter of bicycles and trains, and information an issue of understanding and social empathy.

d. Ethics of Integration

Wonder and analysis are good when they are integrated. We cannot have just wonder, or only analysis. Yet, integrated or not, wonder must come from within and never as a result of drugs and electrical stimulation of the brain. Analysis must be within the social context and never merely a computerized battle toward solutions. Phenomenological ethics shows awe to be the view that things are fundamentally one, and culturally uplifting. Basic to all is our wonder that reality is a beautiful, awesome, non-problematic existence.

Existence is more than just a problem to be solved, a difficulty to be overcome. Existing ought mean appreciating life, people, God, culture, and all plants and animals. We cannot just look at the world as an ongoing defect to be repaired. Life may have evil in it, but is not essentially evil. It is a wondrous reality. This view is available to us not just through drugs, but our very natural feeling of awe. Again, good parenting and better social structure can contribute to or take away from this feeling.

Albert Einstein displayed ethics when he told his fellow scholars at Princeton to stop by an say hello from time to time. Most scholars were shocked. They felt that Princeton was a place for intellectual discourse instead of chit chat and normal conversation. They felt even more strongly that Einstein's work was so critical that they did not wish to interfere in his studies with what they consider small talk or any conversation irrelevant to scientific work.

We think of Einstein as a scientist. He was clearly displaying what phenomenology calls intersubjectivity and wonder as the basis of any scientific work. Einstein believed that normal human beings, even those in intensive scholarly research, needed and should engage in the wonder of interpersonal, face to face community that this the social foundations of any verbal communications. Community is the basis of communications. We cannot communicate or convey information from person to person unless we first establish of acknowledge what phenomenology calls the "given" community or lived world.

e. People

In phenomenological ethics, we are first, last, and always in the community of people, in intersubjectivity, wonder, awe, or the non-cognitive. We are one with vegetation, with nature, with spiritual powers or religious dimensions. The term "people like us" is not to be taken as meaning individuals of our race, creed, color, or gender. It is to be interpreted as meaning that all human beings in the world are like each other. People are the same, regardless of race, creed, and so on.

Wonder means that all things are essentially related with each other. We do not first sense races, creeds, religions, and genders, and then arrive, step by step, to our humanity. The first thing we sense is that all individuals are alike. Races, religions, and so on are differentiations that we tend to make in distinguishing each other. Wonder makes it clear that whatever else we have as differences, human beings are, at bottom, the same.

Only within the context of fundamental awe of the unity of all things, do we then take apart or analyze people from each other, animals, nature, and so on. Analysis, done within awe, is benign. Analysis done outside the framework of wonder becomes mere taking apart of the essentially unified. In this sense, analysis becomes mere destruction.

Wonder and analysis in the ethical perspective comprise our intersubjective, sensory, rational unity. This occurs only when awe and analytic thinking occur within the context of the ethic or ethos: culture. Human beings are meant to awe that they are in the unified world of people, animals, vegetation and nature. Nothing is or ought be totally objectified. We are meant also to differentiate or analyze carefully in order to understand and intellectually cope with the existing world. Within awe, we objectify in order to develop an intellectual stance about why things are as they are.

Intersubjectivity and objectivity go hand in hand. Intersubjectivity or wonder devoid of objectivity becomes dangerously anti-technology. Objectivity alone becomes anti-human. Ethics tells us that this integration is complete when we appreciate intersubjectivity through normal human activity and not through drugs. We need also appreciate objectivity through normal intellectual activity and never through seeing speed, technology, or quantification as an end in itself.

The awe of our being together as a basis for any technique in analyzing that intersubjectivity can be seen MIT's OpenCourseWare. Classroom learning with face to face interaction is fundamental to any distance learning. Wonder occurs not through mechanical activity but the social interaction found in the classroom; analysis is then found not through sophisticated telecourses, but computers existing and operating in the service and context of face-to-face interaction.

Alfred North Whitehead (p. 232) says that philosophy begins in wonder, and that wonder continues after philosophers have analyzed reality. Judith Boss says ethics begins in wonder. Philosophy can say that wonder and analysis begin with ethics, and that ethics continues as the context or orientation for analysis and wonder, and all activity.

2. Tying Phenomenological Ethics to the World

a. Overview

A key model that represents the way to tie phenomenological ethics to the world is by examining ethics, philosophy, and engineering. Scholars in the field of ethics would say that their field provides basic ideas unifying engineering and philosophy. Those thinkers who are ethicists would indicate that engineering and philosophy share a common ground in ethics. Engineering and philosophy are specific manifestation of ethics. The ethicist's position sees engineering and philosophy as fields where human beings and values orient technology, objectivity, reason, and logic.

Ethicists (Kazanjian, 1998, Chapter 2) would view ethics as unifying engineering and philosophy. Scholars in ethics would view their field as underlying the humanistic thinking in philosophy, and the scientific views of engineering. Those who study ethics would see ethical ideas as necessary in courses in virtually all disciplines and professions. These scholars see ethics as an interdisciplinary foundation to the arts and sciences. For ethicists, business ethics, legal ethics, medical and biomedical ethics, engineering ethics, are all integral parts of business, law, medicine, and the other disciplines. Those who are ethics scholars would say business ought engage in ethical instead of unethical practices. These ethicists would also see lawyers, physicians, biomedical researchers, engineers, and others as competent when their curriculum teaches them values and morals as well as technical expertise. Ethicists would say that values and morals orient technique. The ethical perspective sees the mechanics of a given field as ethically oriented. Ethics scholars would view any disciplinarian as a professional concerned with human beings instead of merely a cognitive or technical, non-ethical expert. Scholars from the field of ethics see their work as interdisciplinarity, among their tasks being the disclosure of the ethical basis of engineering and philosophy. As such, ethicists see their discipline as basic to liberal arts and sciences, and interdisciplinarity at any level.

b. Human Factors Engineering

Human factors engineering, also known as ergonomics or ergonomic engineering, is that kind of engineering which designs physical environments including machines and processes to match human limits and abilities, and train people to use those environments (Chapanis, p.534; Kantowicz and Sorkin, p. 20). These engineers work with mathematics, physics, chemistry, and often computers. Beyond these scientific and technical fields, ergonomics engineers deal with human beings. These engineers are concerned not only with how to design an environment, but how to design it to be safe for the user.

The ergonomics position sees safety as meaning that engineers ought design the environments to be user friendly and ought avoid both user unfriendly and user too friendly designs (Adams, p. 256). A design that is user unfriendly ignores the user. To be user unfriendly means is a design whereby the machine or process is dangerous or offensive for the user. The other design is user too friendly, whereby the machine or process is so safe as to be rendered unfunctional. Designing something as user friendly means that users are able to work with an environment which takes into account the users' limits and abilities. Such limits and abilities mean people have arms, legs, eyes, ears, and torsos with certain anatomic and sensory measurements. Arms bend in certain ways and are of certain lengths. The same with legs. Ears hear best at certain sound levels. We see best at certain distances.

Ergonomics is saying that human beings see, hear, and move within certain physical parameters. People do not merely perceive, sense, move, and so on. Any machine or process ought be designed such that it allows the user to use it comfortably, without undue stress or tension. Designing user friendly machines or processes is right. Designing an environment that forces people to merely sense or move is wrong. At the other extreme, designing an environment so safe that users need not make any effort to learn or use it is also wrong. The system could become nonfunctional.

The typical human factors engineering text looks like a combination engineering, psychology, and biology book. Ergonomics engineers say that any physical environment is as much social and psychological as it is mathematical, physical, or chemical. No user friendly design is totally reducible to the sum of nuts and bolts. Human factors argues that objects and people comprise an interface: both are interrelated to each other. Machines/processes and human beings ought not be seen as mutually exclusive, but inherently human-oriented. Al Gini (p. 3) argues that work is vital to our identity, but it must be a humanizing career and never just meaningless, dehumanizing sum of tasks.

Human factors also rejects overemphasizing the user. If machines/processes are to take into account the user's abilities and limits, they are not to simply make things so safe and user-friendly that the machine/procedure becomes unfunctional or unable to perform its technical task.

c. Phenomenology: Brentano

Phenomenology is the philosophical movement somewhere between existentialism and logical positivism. Existentialists would see human beings or any aspect of reality almost totally irreducible to numbers or rational explanation, while the logical positivist position would view people and any reality as totally reducible to number and reason. The existential position views our social and cultural embodiment or existence is almost completely irreducible to number and reason, whereas logical positivism and linguistic analysis see our existence as basically, perhaps totally, rational and numeric. Brentano is considered the founder of phenomenology. He (Stewart and Mickunas, p. 8) initiated the idea of intentionality. Intentionality means that consciousness or embodiment inherently relates to objects. Consciousness is consciousness of objects. Brentano attempted to overcome the logical positivist notion that objects and sensation are real, and consciousness is totally reducible to objectivity.

Brentano would see the thinking mind and the body mutually interrelated . He believed Cartesian dualism is wrong in stating that thinking and the body are two different entities. In speaking about the mind-body unity, Brentano set the stage for Husserl to develop phenomenology. Brentano spoke of the mind-body continuum and rejected total objectivity. Thinking is continuous or interrelated with the body. But Husserl more fully developed the continuum and rejecting two extremes: thinking alone or objectivism, and mere embodiment or subjectivism.

d. Phenomenology: Edmund Husserl

Edmund Husserl moved beyond Brentano (Stewart and Mickunas, p. 8). Husserl sees a development of the mind-body continuum. Objectivity or mind is never value-free or disembodied, according to Husserl. All objectivity is value-laden or occurs as worldly, social, cultural. This view contrasts with the logical positivist notion that objectivity is the sole reality, and value-free.

Husserl's position would say objectivity ought be seen as reflecting or matching subjectivity or values. From the perspective of phenomenology, we must consider all phenomena as real that appear to consciousness or our thoughts. Where logical positivists and linguistic analysts, and all emotional terms such as God as poetry and not cognitively meaningful, phenomenologists believe all objectivity reflects subjectivity, culture, values, and ethics.

The phenomenological position sees the mind-body issue in the manner that people ought look at physical environments as continuous with subjectivity, and emotions and noncognitive ideas as the social milieu generating the meaning of physical environments. Phenomenologically, objects, cognition, and cultural artifacts are real: products of human or subjective intentions. Mathematics, physics, chemistry, computers, and all the arts and sciences must be seen as part of life. But these cognitive realities emerge from a social, subjective realm and are not to be divorced from human experience. Cognition is never reducible to numbers, symbols, sense perception, and other non-emotive reality. Words reflect human experiences as a whole.

The position of phenomenology is that objectivity to be value-laden and ought avoid two extremes. One extreme is value-free cognition. This is cognition whereby cognition or any object is seen as free of any emotive or cultural values or spirituality. The other extreme means extreme existentialism that rejects any reducibility. Here, science, technology and any cognitive effort is considered almost anti-human. Phenomenology sees cognition and physical environments as things that take into account our values and any other noncognitive being. People have cognitive and analytical abilities and ought use them in certain ways. Knowing is not a simple matter of sense perception and analysis. The blanket denial of the reality of noncognitive ideas such as God and values suggests too simplistic a means of getting at reality.

Husserl also rejects subjectivism or solipsism. In saying that everything appearing to consciousness is real, critics argues that he was dangerous near, if not in fact, advocating solipsism. However, Husserl reject both logical positivism's cold objectivism, which says people are objects and values unreal, and extreme existentialism and subjectivism's solipsism, which maintains that the self is the only reality.

Phenomenology: Alfred Schutz (p. 140) comes from the perspective of applied phenomenology. Specifically, his viewpoint is sociology. He considers sociology as the study of "lived history," or human institutions within which we find chronological or day to day history. He points out that human beings see, hear, and move within value parameters. Social structures comprise "lived history," and are the context within which "chronological history" makes sense. Schutz ideas are similar to those of Kenneth Boulding. Boulding, while not technically a phenomenologist, notes that perception and action occur within our images of wholes, and never as the sensing of raw data or merely mechanical anatomic movement. People do not merely perceive, sense, move, and so on.

In phenomenology, consciousness intends or is consciousness of objects, thus revealing a subject-object continuum. Objectivity, perception and movement, in turn, are colored by our values and lived world. Objectivity is continuous with subjectivity. Subjectivity is never the reality of just one person, but intersubjective or social. Thus, phenomenology rejects the existential notion of extreme individuality or the virtually solipsistic ego.

Reality, in phenomenology, is the subject-object continuum or duality. Phenomenologists say we ought avoid Cartesian dualism of the mutually exclusive mind and body. Consciousness is always of the object, and the object is always embodied. Ricoeur (p. 217) argues that phenomenology overcomes Cartesian dualism by reintroducing the excarnate mind into the carnate or body. His efforts enable phenomenology to resolve dualism, as well as the objectivism of positivism, and subjectivism of existentialism.

The mind-body continuum means that subjectivity and objectivity are both real, but comprise a systematic reality instead of parts being real in themselves. Human beings exist in a world of physical reality. We sense this as we consider the lived world of culture giving meaning to material objects and generating ideas. Subjectivity does not exist alone; it requires a object. Likewise, objectivity is not merely "out there;" it is always perceived within cultural, lived orientations.

The phenomenological view is that subjectivity is never devoid of objectivity, while the solipsistic position entails subjectivity as devoid of objectivity. We need the world, for people are part of physical reality. Interpreting objectivity as devoid of subjectivity is similarly wrong. It becomes a dehumanized objectivity disregarding human beings and consciousness. Along these lines and seemingly less serious a problem, dualism is just as wrong, according to phenomenology. Objects and subjects are irreducible to mutual distinct, inherently unrelated entities. We do not just take discreet objectivity and subjectivity and externally juxtapose them. We would be unable to bridge the subject-object gap if it were intrinsically discontinuous or unbridged.

e. Phenomenology and Ergonomics: Parallels

Human factors engineering and phenomenology appear to be mutually distinct fields. One is engineering and quantitative, the other a philosophical movement rejecting total quantification. As such, engineering and phenomenology would seem to be irreconcilable disciplines: engineering being strictly hard culture, phenomenology fundamentally soft culture. But our brief statements above show something else.

A glance at human factors engineering and phenomenology reveals parallels. Human factors believes that all physical environment interface with people. Objects ought be designed as continuous with human operators. The entire system is a machine-person interface or continuum, instead of the machine being something totally objective and non-personal. Phenomenology says that mind or objectification is continuous with the social dimension. Phenomenologists speak of the mind-body continuum. Human factors could speak of the machine-user continuum, phenomenology of the mind-body interface. Human factors would be saying machines are continuous with the user, phenomenology would be indicating that the mind interrelates with the body. In ergonomics, seeing designs or actual machines means seeing the operator or subjectivity. In phenomenology, seeing words on paper must mean seeing human values and other intangibles. For human factors engineers, machines/processes ought be acknowledged as intrinsically continuous or interfacing with people's physical, social, and psychological limits. In phenomenology, the written word ought be recognized as inherently continuous with values and other cultural themes underlying the empirical.

Human factors says machines/processes ought be user-friendly, and ought not be user-unfriendly. Phenomenology maintains that objectivity ought be seen as value-laden, and never value-free. By user friendly, human factors means buttons, numbers, levers, lights, and other physical apparatus the operations and reasons of which the user can learn relatively easily, and the use of which will not harm the person. The human being need not be the proverbial rocket scientist to understand these operations; training would not require the typical user to earn a Ph.D., or even take one course from MIT. The user also need not be made of steel or physically qualify for Navy SEAL commando work to use the environment. The user friendly environment is designed for the typical person's intellectual and physical abilities. By value-laden, phenomenology means any word ultimately reflects human values. No word is or can be value-free, as the philosophical movements logical positivism and .linguistic analysis tend to maintain. Positivists and analytic thinkers argue that words such as God, love, and religion do not belong in intellectual discourse because they reflect values and emotion. Words such as chair, table, atom and other words are value-free and non-emotive. However, chair reflects the English language, can imply the electric chair, can mean a department head at a college or university, and appears to be nonsexist relative to the apparently sexist term chairman. Phenomenologists would maintain that no word is value-free, that every term is a sociology of that term. Every word emerges from and reflects the social and cultural framework that produces it.

A user unfriendly environment is totally objective, ignoring human limits and abilities and forcing people to mere push, pull, and perceive. Al Gini (p. 120) notes that work offering no hope and becoming unethical is wrong, and means roughly what ergonomics means by user unfriendly work. Value-free language would mean a totally objective set of words over which there is no debate. However, every math, computer, physics and other science book or piece of literature reflects a human author and the author's perspective, slant, or view. Feminism and civil rights thinkers have shown that such books (any book) are value-laden whether we like it or not. Each is written by a white male, black male, Latino woman, or person of a particular religious, ethnic, or sexual orientation. An author lacking ethnic, gender, and similar human qualities is impossible.

Human factors could say machines ought be user-laden, while phenomenologists might indicate that objectivity ought be seen as subject-friendly. The human factors term "user" is synonymous with phenomenology's term “subject.” User and subject mean the human being and the cultural context from which the human being emerges.

Both ergonomics and phenomenology look at human-made environments as reflecting culture and not as just cognitive, scientific, or merely objective fields of study and work. Moreover, both ergonomics and phenomenology consider the human as part of the object. Thus, ergonomics notes that we ought avoid simply catering to the person's every desire and want, and phenomenology rejects solipsism's view that the individual is the sole reality.

f. Phenomenology and Ergonomics: Enter Ethics

The previous section notes the technical parallels between ergonomics and phenomenology. Readers will see the term "ought" throughout the paragraphs.

Phenomenology and human factors have fundamental parallels, as indicated in the previous section. These are intellectual or technical similarities. They indicate that both see a unity of objects and people.

In doing so, they are ethical in the general sense. Both machines and rational thought emerge from the social context. Ergonomics argues that machines reflect the social and cultural milieu, and are not totally reducible to nuts and bolts. Phenomenologists (Stewart and Mikunas, p. 10) note that God, love, anger, desire, and other intangibles are real because they appear to consciousness. Secular phenomenologists consider nonreligious themes as real. Religious phenomenologists believe that theological and spiritual notions such as God are real.

Both human factors experts and phenomenologists deny that sensation is our only way of knowing and experiencing. Ergonomics engineers would say it is wrong or unethical to design a machine or process that has operators simply "look," “hear,” or otherwise sense a control panel or other part of a machine. Phenomenologists argue that we would be outside the ethos or culture if we considers human behavior or reality as strictly sensory phenomena.

Engineers abide by and study professional ethics, and the Occupational Safety and Health Administration monitors dangerous in the workplace according to federal law. Phenomenology, however, does not become part of a professional ethics issue except in the case of the ethics of teaching. It may seem that in phenomenology, the subject-object discontinuity or dichotomy is only an academic rather than a technically ethical matter as in engineering. To say that objects are disconnected from and do not reflect subjectivity is not an ethical matter.

Phenomenology is concerned with ethics in the broad sense of ethos or culture. Totally reducing knowledge or reality to the empirical means excarnating or taking sensation out of the social realm comprising ethos. In applied phenomenology, reducing people to computerized forms, numbers, and related paper work may be seen an unethical or socially undesirable.

In acknowledging the social and psychological as well as physical side of people, both human factors engineering and phenomenology are rooted in the sociology of human-made products. A sociology of work suggests that people do not just "do." They do and know within social, ethos, and thereby ethical constraints.

Both human factors engineering and phenomenology share the view that the person or subject is not alone. In ergonomics, machines ought take the user into account, but this does not mean that the design reflect everything about the user. Physical environments should not be so designed as to satisfy every want, desire, and whim of the operator. Operators need to be trained, and put forth effort to realize that the environment requires change on the users' part. Additionally, operators are continuous with their surroundings. They are not Luddites, working or existing alone, without the use of physical environments. Phenomenology says that subjectivity is not the same as subjectivism. In subjectivism, the self is considered to be alone, devoid of objectivity.

Phenomenology seems not to fall into the same ethics category of including punishments for unethical behavior as does human factors engineering. However, the culture that supports a totally dehumanized attitude toward people, such as allowing computerization to go wild and reduce everyone to numbers in every instance, is manifesting an anti phenomenological view. The positivism attitude is that we merely know and are excarnated from feelings and emotions. No ethical ruling can be made against positivism as an intellectual movement Yet positivism reflects the culture view that we can and ought ignore feeling and other intangibles.

The lived world is phenomenology's notion that people live, work, and play in a social context where not everything is totally reducible to numbers or is effable. Paul Ricouer tells us that Cartesian dualism is the effort to see the world and the mind as two different substances. The Cartesian world-view means that cognition is excarnate, discontinuous with the body. Positivism argues that the cognitive is all there exists. Ricoeur would want us to reintroduce the cognitive into the lived world, and to see cognition as incarnate or embodied.

Broadly speaking, the embodied viewpoint is the ethos-oriented viewpoint whereby cognitive activity emerges from the parameters of culture. People ought not just think. Basically, they never just think. Thus, no individual ought take the stand that we are simply thinking substances, whether this substance is somehow related to the body in dualistic terms, or stands by itself in positivistic notions. On the other hand, the cognitive is part of life. We ought not consider the reductive or cognitive as unwarranted, as in much existentialism. We certainly ought not take the view that the cognitive does not have a reality, that the self is alone, that each of us is isolated.

The ethical view posits a holistic perspective. Objectification ought be seen as interfacing or being continuous with the subject or intersubjectivity. Neither objectification devoid of subjectivity, nor subjectivity without objectivity, is the ought.

Human factors speaks of groups of users, not just a user, as reference for designing machines. Phenomenology speaks of intersubjectivity, not just of one subject, a reference for seeing the cognitive. Both ergonomics and phenomenology look at individuals as social, and their limits and abilities are pertaining to groups rather than to one or two people.

Phenomenological thinkers take the position that could be interpreted as the philosophical version of ergonomics. In ergonomics, we do not hear of linguistic analysis, logical positivism , or existentialism. Yet, Ergonomics reveals or deals with language in the broadest sense. When ergonomics speaks of people seeing, hearing, touching, pulling, they are using language. In saying that a person is something that simply sees, hears, etc., we are being positivistic and reducing the individual to an object. If we agree that users are human beings who see, hear, and otherwise sense and move within emotive, cultural, and physical contexts, we are then thinking or using language from a phenomenological viewpoint.

Traditional linguistic analysis tends to imply that philosophers in that vein are only thinkers and not fundamentally akin the engineering. An interdisciplinary attitude with a broad vision of language sees things differently. Language analysts in philosophy work with symbolic logic and not technical mathematics. Human factors engineers work with mathematics, but are suggesting that people are indeed at least partly physical, sensory, and material. Ergonomics may be called human factors, but it can also be called subjectivity factors: we need to take the subjective and cultural into account for engineering processes.

As a corollary, the phenomenological position would be that human factors considers users as not mere objects, but that any characteristic of the person that appears to consciousness is a valid reality. Thus, engineers who are only nuts and bolts people traditionally say we are only skin, neurons, senses, and bones. This is very positivistic language. Phenomenologically, users are also values, emotions, spirituality, and ethos as a whole. Human factors and phenomenology are looking at operators as fundamentally human beings with dignity and essentially irreducible qualities.

Logical positivists might argue that their members helped win World War II by cracking Hitler's Enigma Machine code. This is true. On the more fundamental side, Hitler would not have risen to the powerful level that we allowed to him to do so had we been phenomenological and cultural. As he was rising and accumulating power, a cultural view would have told us to stop him in his tracks. Had we done so, war would have been unnecessary, the Normandy invasion would not have had to occur, and Hitlers codes would not have had time to develop to be used against us.

Ethics tells us that human factors and phenomenology speak the same language, though ergonomics is the trained engineer designing machines, and phenomenologists are philosophers trained in inquiry and argument instead of the design of physical environments. Physical environments are but a form of language. Ergonomics and phenomenology speak the same language in terms of acknowledging that objectivity is subject- or value-oriented. Al Gini speaks of work in terms of business ethics: work must be ethical and never unethical.

They speak the same language in saying that human beings are essential social instead of standing alone. The physical, written, and motor environments are never totally reducible to objects "out there." But as reflections of human beings, these environments mirror "our" and not “my” world. Any human value represents the share world-view of numerous individuals comprising a group. Language ought never be either completely symbolic as in the totally logical methods of linguistic analysis, nor ought it be simply one person's language which no other person can understand.

Two people, one a human factors engineer, the other a phenomenologist, can look at a machine or consider a procedure. These two individuals can communicate with each other if they understand their shared viewpoint. Both are coming from the ethical perspective. The engineer is saying that the numbers, words, and motions, which is to say, the language, of a system, ought reflect human beings in light of culture. A phenomenologist is saying that the writings in a human factors text ought reflect the social, psychological and related value-oriented words and meanings we see in culture.

Both the ergonomics and phenomenological philosopher would agree that the human values comprise a share enterprised that reflects the objective world continuous with the cultural milieu. No person is an island, no person is reducible to flesh and bones. Somewhere between extreme individualism and mere objectivism, the subject-object continuum or machine-person interface comprises a reality including the validity of external and internal worlds.

Ethics means objects are the externalizing of human ideas and the validity of the outside world. As ethos, we are neither extra-ethos nor merely ethos. The extra-ethos or extra-ethical suggests that people are sensations and motions; the merely ethos or ethical can mean we are only a commune, only a community doing little or nothing. Pushed to the extreme, the commune leads to the individual member as possibly believing that he or she stands alone.

In both human factors and phenomenology, language as our fundamental nature is seen as an object-subjective reality. Positivism sees language as symbols and sensory activity; traditional engineering involving merely nuts and bolts sees machines, and therefore language, as the sum total of physical parts. Human factors and phenomenology, rooted in ethos, consider language as a holistic reality whereby being serves to objectify itself through beings.

g. Ethics as Homological

We typically think of ethics as a course of study, as in professional or philosophical ethics. In that way, ethics is no more fundamental than any other discipline. The above pages show that ethics is isomorphic or homological. Isomorphic is derived from iso meaning the same, and morphic meaning shape. Ethics is the same shape or principle that underlies ergonomics and phenomenology. Homological is derived from homo means same, and logic meaning word or structure. Ethics is the same structure from which ergonomics and phenomenology are derived. Learning ethics is basic to human factors engineering and phenomenology. As we consider ethics, we find it necessary to objectify within the parameters of culture, values, and perhaps spirituality. From the engineering perspective, ethics becomes a method of developing physical structures for human use. From the philosophical view, ethics can be interpreted as the intellectual inquiry into knowledge and reality.

As an isomorphic or homological root to human factors and phenomenology, ethics becomes the foundations for a liberal arts. Whatever we know and do, we are inherently facing the opportunity to know and do what is humane, and what is not. This opportunity means intellectual and engineering approaches are basically ethical. They emerge from culture or ethos. To deny values would be to reject our cultural foundations; to seek only values would be unrealistic.

Interdisciplinary research has gone in two directions. One is interdisciplinarity in the sense of team teaching and putting together courses and topics in some sort of seamless or minimally seamed fabric. Ethics plays an equity role here. It is one of the disciplines or ideas relevant to knowledge. The other direction (Kazanjian, 2002, p. 30) is more fundamental. This is the isomorphic direction. Isomorphic or homological ethics means that we must study ethics as a cultural, ethos framework within which we find the roots for all other professions.

Ethics as the homological root of numerous disciplines can thereby show us how to understand human factors engineering and phenomenology. Take ethics away from ergonomics and we essentially eliminate human factors engineering. The very term "human factor" implies that ethos is basic to engineering. Take ethics away from phenomenology and we basically have logical positivism. The subjective orientations of objectivity refer to the ethos from which emerges the objective.

Contemporary interest in professional ethics implies that ethical and non-ethical thinking and doing is something new. Indeed, our admission is new. The existence of the ethical perspective is as old as humanity. Mircea Eliade (p. 31) has taken pains to elucidate the validity of ethics in primitive cultures. In every society we have dos and don'ts. Without that view, any person in any culture will simply do or know, and the result could hurt that person or others.

Eliade's point concerns comparative religion. Ancient societies did everything by repeating the anatomic gestures as performed in Primordial Time by the gods. Primordial Time is the time before the gods created the world and our idea of calendar time. No member of any society simply "did" something. Today, we imply that we merely do or know. Even Eliade suggests that contemporary society is totally secularized. Yet, Clifton Bryant's research in the sociology of work (p. 1) catalogues the social and thus ethical directions of knowledge and technique.

Ethics, then, is not just another topic (Kazanjian, p. 3). It is the ongoing insight that ethos or culture provides us with the framework for survival and etiquette. Human factors and phenomenology are two specific manifestation of that insight.

3. References and Further Reading

a. Theory

  • Clifton D. Bryant ed. The Social Dimensions of Work Englewood Cliffs, NJ.: Prentice-Hall; 1972
  • Martin Buber I and Thou New York: Charles Scribner's Sons; 1970.
  • Jeremy Campbell The Improbable Machine New York: Simon and Schuster; 1989,
  • Mircea Eliade Patterns in Comparative Religion Cleveland: The World Publishing Company; 1958.
  • Michael M. Kazanjian Learning Values Lifelong The Netherlands: Rodopi; 2002.
  • Paul Ricoeur Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary Evanston, IL: NorthwesternUniversity Press; 1968.
  • David Stewart and Algis Mackunas Exploring Phenomenology Athens, OH: Ohio University Press; 1990.
  • G. Harry Stine The Hopeful Future New York: Macmillan;1983.
  • Alfred North Whitehead Modes of Thought New York: The Macmillan Company; 1958.

b. Tying Phenomenological Ethics to the World

  • Jack A. Adams Human Factors Engineering. New York: Macmillan; 1989.
  • Mircea Eliade Patterns in Comparative Religion. Cleveland, OH: World Publishing; 1963.
  • Clifton D. Bryant ed. The Sociology of Work. Englewood Cliffs, New Jersey: Prentice Hall; 1972.
  • Alphonse Chapanis, "Human Engineering," in Operations Research and Systems Engineering ed. Charles D. Flagle, William H. Huggins, and Robert R. Roy, Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press; 1960.
  • Al Gini My Job, My Self. New York: Routledge; 2001.
  • Edmund Husserl Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to PhenomenologicalPhilosophy The Netherlands: Kluwer; 1967..
  • Barry H. Kantowicz and Robert D. Sorkin. Human Factors. New York: John Wiley; 1983.
  • Michael M. Kazanjian Phenomenology and Education The Netherlands: Rodopi: 1998.
    • Especially chapters one and two comparing ethics, human factors, and phenomenology.
  • Michael M. Kazanjian Learning Values Lifelong The Netherlands: Rodopi; 2002.
  • Algis Mikunas and David Stewart Exploring Phenomenology. Athens, OH: Ohio University Press; 1990.
  • Paul Ricoeur Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary. Evanston: Northwestern University Press; 1966.
  • Alfred Schutz The Phenomenology of the Social World. Evanston: Northwestern University Press;1967.

Author Information

Michael M. Kazanjian
U. S. A.

Ignacio Ellacuría (1930—1989)

Ignacio Ellacuría, a naturalized citizen of El Salvador, was born in Spain in 1930. He joined the Jesuits in 1947 and was quickly sent to El Salvador, where he lived and worked for the next forty-two years, except for periods when he was pursuing his education in Ecuador, Spain, and West Germany. He developed an important and novel contribution to Latin American Liberation Philosophy. The body of thought known as Liberation Philosophy developed in Latin America in the second half of the Twentieth Century. It grew out of the works of philosophers working in Peru (A. Salazar Bondy) and Mexico (Leopoldo Zea), and quickly spread throughout Latin America. It resulted from efforts by these philosophers to create a Latin American philosophy by looking at how the discipline could help to make sense of Latin American reality. That reality, as distinct from the European (and later North American) context in which the modern Western philosophical tradition developed, is one of dependence on economic and political (and to some extent cultural) factors that are beyond one’s control. In thematizing dependency, Latin American philosophy developed a liberation philosophy that focused on the social and personal imperative to overcome dependency as the path toward the fullness of one’s humanity, given the conditions of dependency. There are at least five different schools within Latin American liberation philosophy (see Cerutti in the Bibliography below), but all are grounded in the attempt to use philosophy to understand the Latin American reality of dependency and the need to overcome it.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Ellacuría’s Philosophy of Liberation
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Ellacuría's initial training in philosophy was in the Neo-Scholasticism required at that time of all Jesuits. Later he studied Ortega, Bergson, Heidegger, phenomenology, and the existentialists. All of these influenced him, but the key influences in the make up of his mature philosophical thought were Hegel, Marx, and the Basque philosopher Xavier Zubiri (1898-1983). Ellacuría worked on his doctorate under Zubiri from 1962 to 1965, writing a dissertation that reached some 1100 pages on the concept of essence in Zubiri's thought. He also studied theology with the great Heideggerian Jesuit, Karl Rahner, and had finished all the requirements for a second PhD, but did not write the dissertation (which he was also going to write under Zubiri). For the next 18 years, until Zubiri's death in 1983, they were close collaborators, with Ellacuría returning to Spain from El Salvador for a few months each year to facilitate their work. The two worked together on most of Zubiri's texts and talks, eventually reaching the point where Zubiri would not publish something, or even present a lecture, without first showing the material to Ellacuría.

Zubiri is a major figure in 20th century Spanish philosophy and has had a lot of influence in Latin America, largely through the efforts of Ellacuría, but his work is not well known in the countries more traditionally associated with Continental Philosophy (France and Germany) or in the Anglo-American tradition. By the age of 23, Zubiri had finished both a PhD in theology at the Gregorian University and a PhD in philosophy at the University of Madrid. At 28 he was named to the prestigious chair in the history of philosophy at the University of Madrid, and for the next few years he traveled widely in Europe to study with experts in many different fields: philosophy with Husserl and Heidegger, physics with Schrödinger and De Broglie, as well as biology and mathematics with luminaries of the day. Zubiri also taught in Paris at the Institut Catholique and at the University of Barcelona, but in 1942 he left formal academia and for the rest of his life conducted seminars on his own.

From among a large number of very important publications, his two most important are On Essence (1963) and the three-volume work, Sentient Intelligence (1980-83). Ellacuría, who knew all of Zubiri's work, was particularly familiar with these two works: his doctoral dissertation was on the former, and he worked very closely with Zubiri to bring the latter to publication before Zubiri's death.

Zubiri created a systematic philosophy grounded in a re-configuring and overcoming of the distinction between epistemology and metaphysics, between the knower and the known (for more, see the section below on Ellacuría's philosophy). There are now various interpretations of Zubiri's work (among others, phenomenological, Nietzschean, praxical) with Ellacuría heading up the historical/metaphysical interpretation. Although there is no agreement among Zubirian scholars as to which among these is the better interpretation, the fact that Zubiri adopted Ellacuría as his closest collaborator for the last 20 years of his life has to lend some weight to Ellacuría's interpretation

Ellacuría was murdered in 1989 - along with five other Jesuits with whom he lived, their housekeeper and her daughter – at the hands of an elite, US-trained squadron of the Salvadoran army. The murders came towards the end of El Salvador's long civil war (1980-1992) between a right-wing government and leftist guerillas. At the time of his death, Ellacuría was president of the country's prestigious Jesuit university, the University of Central America (UCA), as well as chair of its philosophy department and editor of many of its scholarly publications. In his quarter century with the UCA, the last ten years as its president, he had played a principle role in molding it into a university whose full institutional power - that is, through its research, teaching and publications - was directed towards uncovering the causes of poverty and oppression in El Salvador. In addition, he spoke out frequently on these topics as a regular contributor to the country's newspapers, radio and television programs. He also addressed these topics frequently in his scholarly publications on philosophy and theology. These were the reasons behind his murder.

During his lifetime Ellacuría was known, primarily, as one of the principle contributors to Latin American liberation theology. However, he also spent the last two decades of his life elaborating a liberation philosophy. The latter work was left, at the time of his murder, unfinished, unpublished, and scattered across many different writings. In the years since his death, a number of scholars have pieced together his philosophical thought, and it is now possible to argue that Ellacuría had a well-developed philosophy that represents an important contribution to Latin American liberation philosophy.

2. Ellacuría's Philosophy of Liberation

Ellacuría argued that philosophy, in order to remain true to itself, must be a philosophy of liberation. He begins with the assertion that it is the responsibility of philosophy to help us in figuring out what reality is and in situating ourselves within reality. For Ellacuría, human reality is historical and social: the range of possibilities in which the freedom of any given individual's life must be exercised is the result of both past human actions and the society in which the individual lives. Human actions accrete as history, and within this reality individuals and societies are able to realize some of the possibilities handed over by the past, in the process creating new possibilities to hand over to future generations. There is progress in reality, from the physical to the biological to the praxical, each of these representing a further unfolding of an ever more complex reality. In the realm of praxis (his word for human action to change reality), human beings act to realize a wider range of possibility: praxis seeks to realize a fuller praxis. Thus, praxis realizes a gradual increase in liberty: praxis gradually liberates liberty.

Human beings, as praxical beings, are responsible for the further unfolding of reality, i.e., for the realization of a reality in which all praxical beings can fully realize themselves as such. Ellacuría argues that the vantage point from which one can see most clearly what reality unfolding as history has and has not delivered, is the perspective of the marginalized. Thus, the philosophy of history must make a preferential option for the marginalized, i.e., it must be a philosophy of liberation.

Ellacuría's liberation philosophy begins with a critique grounded in a Zubirian metaphysics that is radically critical of all forms of idealism, including most of what has passed for realism in the history of Western philosophy. This critique argues that the Western tradition made a fundamental error, from Parmenides on, in separating sensation and the intellect, an error which distorted all subsequent philosophy. This error resulted in the "logification of intelligence" and the “entification of reality.” By the former, Zubiri means that the full powers of the intellect have been reduced to a predicative logos, i.e., a logos whose function is to determine what things are, in themselves and in relation to other things. Zubiri argues that while this is a vital part of intelligence, it is not the only part and not the most fundamental part, but Western philosophy reduced intelligence to this predicative logos. In doing so, the object of logos, i.e., the being of entities, became the sum total of reality: reality became entified. These two distortions (the logification of intelligence and entification of reality) can only be overcome by the recognition that sensation and intellection are not separate, that they are two aspects of a single faculty. Zubiri called this faculty the sentient intellect. By this term he meant that, for human beings, the intellect is always sentient and sensation is always intelligent. The two faculties of sensation and intelligence are, for human beings, one and the same faculty. This new, human faculty, the "sentient intellect," is Zubiri's candidate for the specific difference of human beings as a species: a new type of sensation that is essentially different from the sense faculty of other animals, different by the addition of intelligence.

In what way is human sensation essentially different than the sensation of other animals? For Zubiri, part of every human sensation, but absent in animal sensation, is the awareness that the object sensed is real, i.e., that it is has the property of being something in and of itself, independent from me, that it is not a willful extension of me. This recognition of the real as real is the fundamental act of the intelligence; it is the intellectual act that is part and parcel, structurally, inextricably, of every act of human sensation. Thus, through the unitary faculty of the sentient intellect we apprehend reality as real. The consequence of this is that we are always already installed in reality. There is no question about how the mind reaches what is real, no need to build a bridge between the mind and reality.

The intellect, like the rest of the body, evolved as a response to challenges posed by the environment. Animals respond to stimuli while humans are confronted with possible realities. Animals are faced with a predetermined cast of responses to a given stimuli. But human beings in any given situation have an open spectrum of options from among which we must choose. We are, in effect, faced with the possibilities of many different realities, and our choices contribute to the determination of reality as it is realized; thus the name that Zubiri gives to human beings: the "reality animal." The openness of the options facing us is the structural basis of our freedom. Freedom is not something mysterious but a result of the evolutionary pressures that lead to the emergence of a sentient intelligence. The evolutionary niche occupied by human beings is one in which the cast of responses to a stimulus grew to the point where there was no longer anything automatic about which possible response would be enacted. Our niche is the one where the huge number of possible responses opened up different potential realities, allowing us more fully to exploit reality's possibilities. In other words, our niche is precisely the freedom to choose from among the huge number of possible responses, i.e., from among the huge number of possible realities. To manage this operation of choosing, animal sensation evolved into the sentient intellect.

So, according to Zubirian metaphysics, human beings are always already installed in reality as the part of reality whose actions determine future reality: humans are the part of reality that now unfolds further reality. In previous eras, the unfolding of reality took place by physical and biological forces, but now it is human forces (praxis) that unfolds reality. This is not to say that physical and biological forces are no longer present. They are present, and continue to form the foundation of praxis, but praxis outstrips them. An authentic praxis, however, must recognize its foundation in biology and physics - that is why the physical and biological needs of human beings must be met in order for the fullness of human praxis to be realizable. Thus, an authentic praxis must strive for a reality in which the physical and biological needs of all humans are met.

Ellacuría concludes from all of this that the primary question facing human beings - metaphysical and ethical at once – is: given that we are always already in reality, what is the proper way to engage it? Ellacuría characterizes Zubiri's intellectual motto as "to come as close as possible, intellectually, to the reality of things." Western philosophy “had not found an adequate way to shoulder responsibility for reality [hacerse cargo de la realidad]." The search for the right way to engage reality was the motivation for Ellacuría's work. For Ellacuría, humans are now shouldered with responsibility for reality in the sense of being charged with the task of figuring out what is the proper way of exercising the fundamental freedom opened up by the advent, within evolution, of the sentient intellect. In this sense, human beings are the responsible part of reality, i.e., the part of reality whose task it is to figure out how to respond to reality thereby creating a new reality unfolded out of the previous reality. In order for humans to properly exercise this responsibility, we must discern the direction in which reality needs to be taken.

The sentient intellect evolved to enable us to act more effectively in insuring our own survival. This is not selfish, as it may at first sound, given the element of responsibility that comes along with the sentient intellect. As the reality animal, our actions decide between various possible future realities. Thus, as the responsible part of reality, we are now charged with assisting in the further realization of reality. Ellacuría gives the special name of "praxis" to this action that determines reality.

If we look at the development of reality, we can discern a progression from matter, to life, to human life. This progression has been under the control of, first, physical forces, then biological forces, and now, with the evolution of the being with sentient intelligence, the progressive unfolding of reality is subject to the force of praxis. Thus there is a gradual liberation of more developed forces. Subsequent forces do not erase the earlier ones, but rather subsume them dialectically. Thus, human praxis cannot ignore the physical and biological needs of reality: these are the imperatives that must be satisfied on the way to the full realization of praxis itself. Reality has delivered, liberated, successively more developed forces, each layered over the previous: the biological on top of the physical, and the praxical on top of the biological. The direction of this process can be seen: praxis is the most advanced force reality has developed, and praxis must now take its place as the force that most drives the further unfolding of reality (just as physical and biological forces had, successively, taken that place previously). Since the essence of praxis is freedom, human beings must now exercise our freedom such that we further the proper development of reality. To remain true to our essence, and true to the essence of reality, we must act so as to further the development, the spread, of praxis. Thus, the direction of this process of liberation is the liberation of liberty itself, a process for which the reality animal, the praxical being, is responsible. Thus the full realization of reality entails this: praxical beings acting to bring about the realization of the reality in which all praxical beings (that is, all human beings) can realize the fullness of their praxical essence. In other words, physical and biological forces brought about human beings; but the nature of human beings is such that we are now responsible for the further and fuller realization of reality, which realization is precisely the liberation of all human beings such that they can realize the fullness of their essence. Thus Ellacuría is able to argue that the metaphysics of reality demands a liberatory praxis from us: liberation, because of the essence of human beings and the nature of reality, is a metaphysical imperative.

We can begin to see the prescriptions that emerge from the foregoing analysis. Ellacuría's liberation philosophy allows him to argue that the essence of being human demands that society be structured in such a way as to meet the physical and biological needs of human beings at an adequate level, i.e., a level that frees us to pursue our essence as praxical beings. Further, his analysis suggests that it is the duty of those of us who enjoy a wider exercise of freedom to dedicate our talents and efforts towards the construction of such a society: our essence as the leading edge of reality that is now responsible for the further unfolding of reality demands that we assist in the establishment of a reality in which praxis is more fully realized, i.e., a reality in which more people (ultimately, all people) are freed from basic wants (inflicted on them by poverty) so that they can exercise their praxis. In other words, the full self-realization of the privileged lies in their enlisting themselves in the struggles of the oppressed. This does not mean that the privileged have to become oppressed. Rather, it means that they should use the education and power delivered to them by their socially and historically conditioned privilege to further the struggles of the oppressed. Note that this is not paternalistic. The struggles of the oppressed represent the leading edge of reality's further development. The endeavors of the privileged apart from these struggles represent dead-end dilly-dallying (no matter how important they seem to those engaged in them) that does not further the humanization of reality and, thus, will not become an enduring part of human history. Far from paternalism, what saves the privileged from the meaningless pursuits with which they are wont to fill their time, and thus from a meaningless life, is the decision to lend their efforts to further the cause of the oppressed.

Thus, with Zubirian realism and in creative dialogue with Marx, Ellacuría undertook, from the perspective of the poor of the Third World, the project of forging a philosophy that recognized the material nature of being human - and thus the need to take into account the structures of poverty and oppression - while holding open the possibility of a transcendent realm, a realm one and the same with the material realm (actually part of the material realm) in which can exist human freedom and perhaps even God. Ellacuría was constructing a liberation philosophy in the service of the concrete needs of the Latin American people and of the Third World in general. It is a project in the service of which Ellacuría took great strides, but which remained unfinished at his death.

3. References and Further Reading

There still remain a number of unpublished pieces that are important to Ellacuría's liberation philosophy. These consist primarily of extensive notes he took for the courses he taught at the UCA. These, and all of Ellacuría's published and unpublished writings, are located in the Ignacio Ellacuría Archives at the Universidad Centroamericana (UCA) in San Salvador, El Salvador.

  • Burke, Kevin (2000). The Ground Beneath the Cross: The Theology of Ignacio Ellacuría, Washington, DC: Georgetown University Press.
    • In English, this book contains good chapters (chs. 2-4) on the philosophical foundation of Ellacuría's theological thought.
  • Cerutti, Horacio (1992). La Filosofia de la Liberación Latinoamericana, Mexico City: FCE.
    • The best overview of Latin American liberation philosophy, though the book was written before Ellacuría's contributions to the topic were widely known. Thus, Cerutti charts four main currents of Latin American liberation philosophy. Ellacuría's contributions represent a fifth current.
  • Ellacuría, Ignacio (2000-2002). Escritos Teológicos [ET], four volumes, San Salvador: UCA Editores.
    • Some philosophically important pieces are also collected here.
  • Ellacuría, Ignacio (1996-2001). Escritos Filosóficos [EF], three volumes, San Salvador: UCA Editores.
    • His scores of important philosophical essays have been collected here.
  • Ellacuría, Ignacio (1999). Escritos Universitarios [EU], San Salvador: UCA Editores.
    • Some philosophically important pieces are also collected here.
  • Ellacuría, Ignacio (1993). Veinte Años de Historia en El Salvador: Escritos Políticos [VA], three volumes, second edition, San Salvador: UCA Editores.
    • Some philosophically important pieces are also collected here.
  • Ellacuría, Ignacio (1990). Filosofía de la Realidad Histórica, San Salvador: UCA Editores.
    • Ellacuría's main philosophical work. This 600-page book was written and revised a couple of times in the early 1970s. It was never finished (there are indications in his notes that he intended to write more chapters) but it is fairly polished and the best indication of the scope and force of his argument for liberation philosophy.
  • Hassett, John & Hugh Lacey, eds. (1991). Towards a Society that Serves Its People: The Intellectual Contribution of El Salvador's Murdered Jesuits [TSSP], Washington, DC: Georgetown University Press.
    • English translations of eight of his essays (philosophical, theological and political).
  • Samour, Héctor (2002). Voluntad de Liberación: El Pensamiento Filosófico de Ignacio Ellacuría, San Salvador: UCA Editores.
    • The most thorough presentation of Ellacuría's philosophical thought. Samour is the scholar who has done the most to pull together, from the thousands of pages of unpublished and published material, Ellacuría's liberation philosophy and this comprehensive book is the result of his labors.
  • Whitfield, Teresa (1995). Paying the Price: Ignacio Ellacuría and the Murdered Jesuits of El Salvador, Philadelphia: Temple University Press.
    • The best intellectual biography on Ellacuría.

From among all of the collected essays, the most important for understanding Ellacuría's liberation philosophy are the following:

  • "Filosofía y Política" [1972], VA-1, pp. 47-62.
  • "Liberación: Misión y Carisma de la Iglesia" [1973], ET-2, pp. 553-584.
  • "Diez Años Después: ¿Es Posible una Universidad Distinta?" [1975], EU, pp. 49-92 (an English translation is available in TSSP, pp. 177-207).
  • "Hacia una Fundamentación del Método Teológico Latinoamericana" [1975], ET-1, pp. 187-218.
  • "Filosofía, ¿Para Qué?" [1976], EF-3, pp. 115-132.
  • "Fundamentación Biológica de la Ética" [1979], EF-3, pp, 251-269.
  • "Universidad y Política" [1980], VA-1, pp. 17-46.
  • "El Objeto de la Filosofía" [1981], VA-1, pp. 63-92.
  • "Función Liberadora de la Filosofía" [1985], VA-1, pp. 93-122.
  • "La Superación del Reduccionismo Idealista en Zubiri" [1988], EF-3, pp. 403-430.
  • "El Desafío de las Mayorías Populares" (1989), EU, pp. 297-306 (an English translation is available in TSSP, pp. 171-176).
  • "En Torno al Concepto y a la Idea de Liberación" [1989], ET-1, pp. 629-657.
  • "Utopía y Profetismo en América Latina" [1989], ET-2, pp. 233-294 (an English translation is available in TSSP, pp. 44-88).

Author Information

David I. Gandolfo
Furman University
U. S. A.

Ayn Alissa Rand (1905—1982)

randAyn Rand was a major intellectual of the twentieth century. Born in Russia in 1905 and educated there, she immigrated to the United States after graduating from the university, where she studied history, politics, philosophy, and literature. Rand had always found capitalism and the individualism of the United States a welcome alternative to the corrupt and negative socialism of Russia. Upon becoming proficient in English and establishing herself as a writer in the U.S., she became a passionate advocate of her philosophy, Objectivism.

Rand’s philosophy is in the Aristotelian tradition, with that tradition’s emphasis upon metaphysical naturalism, empirical reason in epistemology, and self-realization in ethics.  Objectivism is rational self-interest and self-responsibility – the idea that no person is any other person’s slave. The virtues of her philosophy are principled policies based on rational assessment: rationality, productiveness, honesty (in order to rationally make the best decisions we must be privy to the facts), integrity, independence, justice, and pride.

Her political philosophy is in the classical liberal tradition, with that tradition’s emphasis upon individualism, the constitutional protection of individual rights to life, liberty, and property, and limited government.

She wrote both technical and popular works of philosophy, and she presented her philosophy in both fictional and non-fictional forms, the most philosophically complete and popular of which are Atlas Shrugged and Fountainhead. Her philosophy has influenced several generations of academics and public intellectuals, as well as having had widespread popular appeal.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Rand's Ethical Theory: The Virtue of Selfishness
    1. Reason and Ethics
    2. Conflicts of Interest
  3. Rand's Influence
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Ayn Rand's life was often as colorful as those of her heroes in her best-selling novels The Fountainhead and Atlas Shrugged. Rand first made her name as a novelist, publishing We the Living in 1936, The Fountainhead in 1943, and her magnum opus Atlas Shrugged in 1957. These philosophical novels embodied themes she then developed in non-fiction form in a series of essays and books written in the 1960s and 1970s.

Born in St. Petersburg, Russia, on February 2, 1905, Rand was raised in a middle-class family. As a child, she loved story-telling, and she decided at age nine to become a writer. In school she showed academic promise, particularly in mathematics. Her family was devastated by the communist revolution of 1917, both by the social upheavals that the revolution and the ensuing civil war brought and by her father's pharmacy's being confiscated by the Soviets. The family moved to the Crimea to recover financially and to escape the harshness of life the revolution brought to St. Petersburg. They later returned to Petrograd (the new name given to St. Petersburg by the Soviets), where Rand was to attend university.

At the University of Petrograd, Rand concentrated her studies on history, with secondary focuses on philosophy and literature. At university, she was repelled by the dominance of communist ideas and strong-arm tactics that suppressed free inquiry and discussion. As a youth, she had been repelled by the communists' political program, and now an adult, she was also more fully aware of the destructive effects that the revolution had had on Russian society more broadly.

Having studied American history and politics in university, and having long been an admirer of Western plays, music, and movies, she became an admirer of America's individualism, its vigor, and its optimism, seeing it as the opposite of Russian collectivism, decay, and gloom. Not believing, however, that she would be free under the Soviet system to write the kinds of books she wanted to write, she resolved to leave Russia and go to America.

Rand graduated from the University of Petrograd in 1924. She then enrolled at the State Institute for Cinema Arts in order to study screen writing. In 1925, she finally received permission from the Soviet authorities to leave the country in order to visit relatives in the United States. Officially, her visit was to be brief; Rand, however, had already decided not to return to the Soviet Union.

After several stops in western European cities, Rand arrived in New York City in February 1926. From New York, she traveled on to Chicago, Illinois, where she spent the next six months living with relatives, learning English, and developing ideas for stories and movies. She had decided to become a screenwriter, and, having received an extension to her visa, she left for Hollywood, California.

On Rand's second day in Hollywood, an event occurred that was worthy of her dramatic fiction and one that had a major impact on her future. She was spotted by Cecil B. DeMille, one of Hollywood's leading directors, while she was standing at the gate of his studio. She had recognized him as he was passing by in his car, and he had noticed her staring at him. He stopped to ask why she was staring, and Rand explained that she had recently arrived from Russia, that she had long been passionate about Hollywood movies, and that she dreamed of being a screen writer. DeMille was then working on "The King of Kings," and gave her a ride to his movie set and signed her on as an extra. Then, during her second week at DeMille's studio, another significant event occurred: Rand met Frank O'Connor, a young actor also working as an extra. Rand and O'Connor were married in 1929, and they remained married for fifty years until his death in 1979.

Rand also worked for DeMille as a reader of scripts, and struggled financially while working on her own writing. She also held a variety of non-writing jobs until in 1932 she was able to sell her first screenplay, "Red Pawn," to Universal Studios. Also in 1932 her first stage play, "Night of January 16th," was produced in Hollywood and later on Broadway.

Rand had been working for years on her first significant novel, We the Living, and finished it in 1933. However, for several years it was rejected by various publishers, until in 1936 it was published by Macmillan in the U.S. and Cassell in England. Rand described We the Living as the most autobiographical of her novels, its theme being the brutality of life under communist rule in Russia. We the Living did not receive a positive reaction from American reviewers and intellectuals. It was published in the 1930s, a decade sometimes called the "Red Decade," during which American intellectuals were often pro-Communist and respectful and admiring of the Soviet experiment.

Rand's next major project was The Fountainhead, which she had begun to work on in 1935. While the theme of We the Living was political, the theme of The Fountainhead was ethical, focusing on individualist themes of independence and integrity. The novel's hero, the architect Howard Roark, is Rand's first embodiment of her ideal man, the man who lives on a principled and heroic scale of achievement.

As with We the Living, Rand had difficulties getting The Fountainhead published. Twelve publishers rejected it before being published by Bobbs-Merrill in 1943. Again not well received by reviewers and intellectuals, the novel nonetheless became a best-seller, primarily through word-of-mouth recommendation. The Fountainhead made Rand famous as an exponent of individualist ideas, and its continuing to sell well brought her financial security. Warner Brothers produced a movie version of the novel in 1949, starring Gary Cooper and Patricia Neal, for which Rand wrote the screenplay.

In 1946, Rand began work on her most ambitious novel, Atlas Shrugged. At the time she was working part-time as a screenwriter for producer Hal Wallis. In 1951 she and her husband moved to New York City, where she began to work full-time on Atlas. Published by Random House in 1957, Atlas Shrugged is her most complete expression of her literary and philosophical vision. Dramatized in the form of a mystery story about a man who stopped the motor of the world, the plot and characters embody the political and ethical themes first developed in We the Living and The Fountainhead, and integrates them into a comprehensive philosophy including metaphysics, epistemology, economics, and the psychology of love and sex.

Atlas Shrugged was an immediate best-seller and Rand's last work of fiction. Her novels had expressed philosophical themes, although Rand considered herself primarily a novelist and only secondarily a philosopher. The creation of plots and characters and the dramatization of achievements and conflicts were her central purposes in writing fiction, rather than presenting an abstracted and didactic set of philosophical theses.

The Fountainhead and Atlas Shrugged, however, had attracted to Rand many readers who were strongly interested in the philosophical ideas the novels embodied and in pursuing them further. Among the earliest of those with whom Rand became associated and who later became prominent were psychologist Nathaniel Branden and economist Alan Greenspan, later Chairman of the Federal Reserve. Her interactions with these and several other key individuals were partly responsible for Rand's turning from fiction to non-fiction writing in order to develop her philosophy more systematically.

From 1962 until 1976, Rand wrote and lectured on her philosophy, now named "Objectivism." Her essays were during this period were mostly published in a series of periodicals, The Objectivist Newsletter, published from 1962 to 1965, the larger periodical The Objectivist, published from 1966 to 1971, and then The Ayn Rand Letter, published from 1971 to 1976. The essays written for these periodicals form the core material for a series of nine non-fiction books published during Rand's lifetime. Those books develop Rand's philosophy in all its major categories and apply it to cultural issues. Perhaps the most significant of the books are The Virtue of Selfishness, which develops her ethical theory, Capitalism: The Unknown Ideal, devoted to political and economic theory, Introduction to Objectivist Epistemology, a systematic presentation of her theory of concepts, and The Romantic Manifesto, a theory of aesthetics.

During the 1960s Rand's most significant professional relationship was with Nathaniel Branden. Branden, author of The Psychology of Self-Esteem and later known as a leader in the self-esteem movement in psychology, wrote many essays on philosophical and psychological topics that were published in Rand's books and periodicals. He was the founder and head of the Nathaniel Branden Institute, the leading Objectivist institution of the 1960s. Based in New York City, N.B.I. published with Rand's sanction numerous Objectivist periodicals and pamphlets, and gave many series of lectures live in New York which were then distributed on tape around the United States and the rest of the world. The rapid growth of N.B.I. and the Objectivist movement came to a halt in 1968 when, for both professional and personal reasons, Rand and Branden parted ways.

Rand continued to write and lecture consistently until she stopped publishing The Ayn Rand Letter in 1976. Thereafter she wrote and lectured less as her husband's health declined, leading to his death in 1979, and as her own health began to decline. Rand died on March 6, 1982, in her New York City apartment.

2. Rand’s Ethical Theory: The Virtue of Selfishness

The provocative title of Ayn Rand's The Virtue of Selfishness matches an equally provocative thesis about ethics. Traditional ethics has always been suspicious of self interest, praising acts that are selfless in intent and calling amoral or immoral acts that are motivated by self interest. A self-interested person, on the traditional view, will not consider the interests of others and so will slight or harm those interests in the pursuit of his own.

Rand's view is that the exact opposite is true: self-interest, properly understood, is the standard of morality and selflessness is the deepest immorality.

Self interest rightly understood, according to Rand, is to see oneself as an end in oneself. That is to say that one's own life and happiness are one's highest values, and that one does not exist as a servant or slave to the interests of others. Nor do others exist as servants or slaves to one's own interests. Each person's own life and happiness is his ultimate end. Self interest rightly understood also entails self-responsibility: one's life is one's own, and so is the responsibility for sustaining and enhancing it. It is up to each of us to determine what values our lives require, how best to achieve those values, and to act to achieve those values.

Rand's ethic of self interest is integral to her advocacy of classical liberalism. Classical liberalism, more often called "libertarianism" in the 20th century, is the view that individuals should be free to pursue their own interests. This implies, politically, that governments should be limited to protecting each individual's freedom to do so. In other words, the moral legitimacy of self interest implies that individuals have rights to their lives, their liberties, their property, and the pursuit of their own happiness, and that the purpose of government is to protect those rights. Economically, leaving individuals free to pursue their own interests implies in turn that only a capitalist or free market economic system is moral: free individuals will use their time, money, and other property as they see fit, and will interact and trade voluntarily with others to mutual advantage.

a. Reason and Ethics

Fundamentally, the means by which we live our lives as humans is reason. Our capacity for reason is what enables us to survive and flourish. We are not born knowing what is good for us; that is learned. Nor are we born knowing how to achieve what is good for us; that too is learned. It is by reason that we learn what is food and what is poison, what animals are useful or dangerous to us, how to make tools, what forms of social organization are fruitful, and so on.

Thus Rand advocates rational self interest: one's interests are not whatever one happens to feel like; rather it is by reason that one identifies what is to one's interest and what isn't. By the use of reason one takes into account all of the factors one can identify, projects the consequences of potential courses of action, and adopts principled policies of action.

The principled policies a person should adopt are called virtues. A virtue is an acquired character trait; it results from identifying a policy as good and committing to acting consistently in terms of that policy.

One such virtue is rationality: having identified the use of reason as fundamentally good, being committed to acting in accordance with reason is the virtue of rationality. Another virtue is productiveness: given that the values one needs to survive must be produced, being committed to producing those values is the virtue of productiveness. Another is honesty: given that facts are facts and that one's life depends on knowing and acting in accordance with the facts, being committed to awareness of the facts is the virtue of honesty.

Independence and integrity are also core virtues for Rand's account of self interest. Given that one must think and act by one's own efforts, being committed to the policy of independent action is a virtue. And given that one must both identify what is to one's interests and act to achieve them, a policy of being committed to acting on the basis of one's beliefs is the virtue of integrity. The opposite policy of believing one thing and doing another is of course the vice of hypocrisy; hypocrisy is a policy of self-destruction, on Rand's view.

Justice is another core self-interested virtue: justice, on Rand's account, means a policy of judging people, including oneself, according to their value and acting accordingly. The opposite policy of giving to people more or less than they deserve is injustice. The final virtue on Rand's list of core virtues is pride, the policy of "moral ambitiousness," in Rand's words. This means a policy of being committed to making oneself be the best one can be, of shaping one's character to the highest level possible.

The moral person, in summary, on Rand's account, is someone who acts and is committed to acting in his best self-interest. It is by living the morality of self interest that one survives, flourishes, and achieves happiness.

This account of self interest is currently a minority position. The contrasting view typically pits self interest against morality, holding that one is moral only to the extent that one sacrifices one's self interest for the sake of others or, more moderately, to the extent one acts primarily with regard to the interests of others. For example, standard versions of morality will hold that one is moral to the extent one sets aside one's own interests in order to serve God, or the weak and the poor, or society as a whole. On these accounts, the interests of God, the poor, or society as a whole are held to be of greater moral significance that one's own, and so accordingly one's interests should be sacrificed when necessary. These ethics of selflessness thus believe that one should see oneself fundamentally as a servant, as existing to serve the interests of others, not one's own. "Selfless service to others" or "selfless sacrifice" are stock phrases indicating these accounts' view of appropriate motivation and action.

The core difference between Rand's self interest view and the selfless view can be seen in the reason why most advocates of selflessness think self interest is dangerous: conflicts of interest.

b. Conflicts of Interest

Traditional ethics takes conflicts of interest to be fundamental to the human condition, and takes ethics to be the solution: basic ethical principles are to tell us whose interests should be sacrificed in order to resolve the conflicts. If there is, for example, a fundamental conflict between what God wants and what humans naturally want, then religious ethics will make fundamental the principle that human wants should be sacrificed for God's. If there's a fundamental conflict between what society needs and what individuals want, then some versions of secular ethics will make fundamental the principle that the individual's wants should be sacrificed for society's.

Taking conflicts of interest to be fundamental almost always stems from one of two beliefs: that human nature is fundamentally destructive or that economic resources are scarce. If human nature is fundamentally destructive, then humans are naturally in conflict with each other. Many ethical philosophies start from this premise - for example, Plato's myth of Gyges, Jewish and Christian accounts of Original Sin, or Freud's account of the id. If what individuals naturally want to do to each other is rape, steal, and kill, then in order to have society these individual desires need to be sacrificed. Consequently, a basic principle of ethics will be to urge individuals to suppress their natural desires so that society can exist. In other words, self interest is the enemy, and must be sacrificed for others.

If economic resources are scarce, then there is not enough to go around. This scarcity then puts human beings in fundamental conflict with each other: for one individual's need to be satisfied, another's must be sacrificed. Many ethical philosophies begin with this premise. For example, followers of Thomas Malthus's theory that population growth outstrips growth in the food supply fall into this category. Karl Marx's account of capitalist society is that brutal competition leads to the exploitation of some by others. Garret Hardin's famous use of the lifeboat analogy asks us to imagine that society is like a lifeboat with more people that its resources can support. And so in order to solve the destructive competition the lack of resources leads us to, a basic principle of ethics will be to urge individuals to sacrifice their interests in obtaining more (or even some) so that others may obtain more (or some) and society can exist peacefully. In others words, in a situation of scarcity self interest is the enemy and must be sacrificed for others.

Rand rejects both the scarce resources and destructive human nature premises. Human beings are not born in sin or with destructive desires; nor do they necessarily acquire them in the course of growing to maturity. Instead one is born tabula rasa ("blank slate"), and through one's choices and actions one acquires one's character traits and habits. As Rand phrased it, "Man is a being of self-made soul." Having chronic desires to steal, rape, or kill others are the result of mistaken development and the acquisition of bad habits, just as are chronic laziness or the habit of eating too much junk food. And just as one is not born lazy but can by one's choices develop oneself into a person of vigor or sloth, one is not born anti-social but can by one's choices develop oneself into a person of cooperativeness or conflict.

Nor are resources scarce in any fundamental way, according to Rand. By the use of reason, humans can discover new resources and how to use existing resources more efficiently, including recycling where appropriate and making productive processes more efficient. Humans have for example continually discovered and developed new energy resources, from animals to wood to coal to oil to nuclear to solar; and there is no end in sight to this process. At any given moment, the available resources are a fixed amount, but over time the stock of resources are and have been constantly expanding.

Because humans are rational they can produce an ever-expanding number of goods, and so human interests do not fundamentally conflict with each other. Instead Rand holds that the exact opposite is true: since humans can and should be productive, human interests are deeply in harmony with each other. For example, my producing more corn is in harmony with your producing more peas, for by our both being productive and trading with each other we are both better off. It is to your interest that I be successful in producing more corn, just as it is to my interest that you be successful in producing more peas.

Conflicts of interest do exist within a narrower scope of focus. For example, in the immediate present available resources are more fixed, and so competition for those resources results, and competition produces winners and losers. Economic competition, however, is a broader form of cooperation, a way socially to allocate resources without resorting to physical force and violence. By competition, resources are allocated efficiently and peacefully, and in the long run more resources are produced. Thus, a competitive economic system is in the self interest of all of us.

Accordingly, Rand argues that her ethic of self interest is the basis for personal happiness and free and prosperous societies.

3. Rand's Influence

The impact of Rand's ideas is difficult to measure, but it has been great. All of the books she published during her lifetime are still in print, have sold more than twenty million copies, and continue to sell hundreds of thousands of copies each year. A survey jointly conducted by the Library of Congress and the Book of the Month Club early in the 1990s asked readers to name the book that had most influenced their lives: Atlas Shrugged was second only to the Bible. Excerpts from Rand's works are regularly reprinted in college textbooks and anthologies, and several volumes have been published posthumously containing her early writings, journals, and letters. Those inspired by her ideas have published books in many academic fields and founded several institutes. Noteworthy among these are the Cato Institute, based in Washington, D.C., the leading libertarian think tank in the world. Rand, along with Nobel Prize-winners Friedrich Hayek and Milton Friedman, was highly instrumental in attracting generations of individuals to the libertarian movement. Also noteworthy are the Ayn Rand Institute, founded in 1985 by philosopher Leonard Peikoff and based in California, and The Objectivist Center, founded in 1990 by philosopher David Kelley and based in New York.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Binswanger, Harry. The Biological Basis of Teleological Concepts. Los Angeles, CA: A.R.I. Press, 1990.
    • Written by a philosopher, this is a scholarly work focused on the connection between biology and the concepts at the roots of ethics.
  • Branden, Nathaniel. The Psychology of Self-Esteem. Los Angeles: Nash Publishing, 1969.
  • Branden, Nathaniel, and Barbara Branden. Who Is Ayn Rand? New York: Random House, 1962.
    • This book contains three essays on Objectivism's moral philosophy, its connection to psychological theory, and a literary study of Rand's novel methods. It contains an additional biographical essay, tracing Rand's life from birth up until her mid-50s.
  • Hessen, Robert. In Defense of the Corporation. Stanford, CA: Hoover Institution, 1979.
    • An economic historian, Hessen argues and defends from an Objectivist perspective the moral and legal status of the corporate form of business organizations.
  • Kelley, David. The Evidence of the Senses. Baton Rouge: L.S.U. Press, 1986.
    • Written by a philosopher, this is a scholarly work in epistemology, focusing on the foundational role the senses play in human knowledge.
  • Mayhew, Robert. Ayn Rand's Marginalia. New Milford, CT: Second Renaissance Books, 1995.
    • This volume contains Rand's critical comments on over twenty thinkers, including Friedrich Hayek, C. S. Lewis, and Immanuel Kant. Edited by a philosopher, the volume contains facsimiles of the original texts with Rand's comments on facing pages.
  • Peikoff, Leonard. The Ominous Parallels: The End of Freedom in America. New York: Stein & Day, 1982.
    • A scholarly work in the philosophy of history, arguing Objectivism's theses about the role of philosophical ideas in history and applying them to explaining the rise of National Socialism.
  • Peikoff, Leonard. Objectivism: The Philosophy of Ayn Rand. New York: Dutton, 1991.
    • This is the first comprehensive overview of all aspects of Objectivist philosophy, written by the philosopher most close to Rand during her lifetime.
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Author Information

Stephen R. C. Hicks
Rockford College
U. S. A.

Thomas Hobbes: Moral and Political Philosophy

hobbesThe English philosopher Thomas Hobbes (1588-1679) is best known for his political thought, and deservedly so. His vision of the world is strikingly original and still relevant to contemporary politics. His main concern is the problem of social and political order: how human beings can live together in peace and avoid the danger and fear of civil conflict. He poses stark alternatives: we should give our obedience to an unaccountable sovereign (a person or group empowered to decide every social and political issue). Otherwise what awaits us is a "state of nature" that closely resembles civil war – a situation of universal insecurity, where all have reason to fear violent death and where rewarding human cooperation is all but impossible.

One controversy has dominated interpretations of Hobbes. Does he see human beings as purely self-interested or egoistic? Several passages support such a reading, leading some to think that his political conclusions can be avoided if we adopt a more realistic picture of human nature. However, most scholars now accept that Hobbes himself had a much more complex view of human motivation. A major theme below will be why the problems he poses cannot be avoided simply by taking a less "selfish" view of human nature.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Life and Times
  3. Two Intellectual Influences
  4. Ethics and Human Nature
    1. Materialism Versus Self-Knowledge
    2. The Poverty of Human Judgment and our Need for Science
    3. Motivation
    4. Political Philosophy
  5. The Natural Condition of Mankind
    1. The Laws of Nature and the Social Contract
    2. Why Should we Obey the Sovereign?
    3. Life Under the Sovereign
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Hobbes is the founding father of modern political philosophy. Directly or indirectly, he has set the terms of debate about the fundamentals of political life right into our own times. Few have liked his thesis, that the problems of political life mean that a society should accept an unaccountable sovereign as its sole political authority. Nonetheless, we still live in the world that Hobbes addressed head on: a world where human authority is something that requires justification, and is automatically accepted by few; a world where social and political inequality also appears questionable; and a world where religious authority faces significant dispute. We can put the matter in terms of the concern with equality and rights that Hobbes's thought heralded: we live in a world where all human beings are supposed to have rights, that is, moral claims that protect their basic interests. But what or who determines what those rights are? And who will enforce them? In other words, who will exercise the most important political powers, when the basic assumption is that we all share the same entitlements?

We can see Hobbes's importance if we briefly compare him with the most famous political thinkers before and after him. A century before, Nicolo Machiavelli had emphasized the harsh realities of power, as well as recalling ancient Roman experiences of political freedom. Machiavelli appears as the first modern political thinker, because like Hobbes he was no longer prepared to talk about politics in terms set by religious faith (indeed, he was still more offensive than Hobbes to many orthodox believers), instead, he looked upon politics as a secular discipline divorced from theology. But unlike Hobbes, Machiavelli offers us no comprehensive philosophy: we have to reconstruct his views on the importance and nature of freedom; it remains uncertain which, if any, principles Machiavelli draws on in his apparent praise of amoral power politics.

Writing a few years after Hobbes, John Locke had definitely accepted the terms of debate Hobbes had laid down: how can human beings live together, when religious or traditional justifications of authority are no longer effective or persuasive? How is political authority justified and how far does it extend? In particular, are our political rulers properly as unlimited in their powers as Hobbes had suggested? And if they are not, what system of politics will ensure that they do not overstep the mark, do not trespass on the rights of their subjects?

So, in assessing Hobbes's political philosophy, our guiding questions can be: What did Hobbes write that was so important? How was he able to set out a way of thinking about politics and power that remains decisive nearly four centuries afterwards? We can get some clues to this second question if we look at Hobbes's life and times.

2. Life and Times

Hobbes's biography is dominated by the political events in England and Scotland during his long life. Born in 1588, the year the Spanish Armada made its ill-fated attempt to invade England, he lived to the exceptional age of 91, dying in 1679. He was not born to power or wealth or influence: the son of a disgraced village vicar, he was lucky that his uncle was wealthy enough to provide for his education and that his intellectual talents were soon recognized and developed (through thorough training in the classics of Latin and Greek). Those intellectual abilities, and his uncle's support, brought him to university at Oxford. And these in turn - together with a good deal of common sense and personal maturity - won him a place tutoring the son of an important noble family, the Cavendishes. This meant that Hobbes entered circles where the activities of the King, of Members of Parliament, and of other wealthy landowners were known and discussed, and indeed influenced. Thus intellectual and practical ability brought Hobbes to a place close to power - later he would even be math tutor to the future King Charles II. Although this never made Hobbes powerful, it meant he was acquainted with and indeed vulnerable to those who were. As the scene was being set for the Civil Wars of 1642-46 and 1648-51 - wars that would lead to the King being executed and a republic being declared - Hobbes felt forced to leave the country for his personal safety, and lived in France from 1640 to 1651. Even after the monarchy had been restored in 1660, Hobbes's security was not always certain: powerful religious figures, critical of his writings, made moves in Parliament that apparently led Hobbes to burn some of his papers for fear of prosecution.

Thus Hobbes lived in a time of upheaval, sharper than any England has since known. This turmoil had many aspects and causes, political and religious, military and economic. England stood divided against itself in several ways. The rich and powerful were divided in their support for the King, especially concerning the monarch's powers of taxation. Parliament was similarly divided concerning its own powers vis-à-vis the King. Society was divided religiously, economically, and by region. Inequalities in wealth were huge, and the upheavals of the Civil Wars saw the emergence of astonishingly radical religious and political sects. (For instance, "the Levellers" called for much greater equality in terms of wealth and political rights; "the Diggers," more radical still, fought for the abolition of wage labor.) Civil war meant that the country became militarily divided. And all these divisions cut across one another: for example, the army of the republican challenger, Cromwell, was the main home of the Levellers, yet Cromwell in turn would act to destroy their power within the army's ranks. In addition, England’s recent union with Scotland was fragile at best, and was almost destroyed by King Charles I's attempts to impose consistency in religious practices. We shall see that Hobbes's greatest fear was social and political chaos - and he had ample opportunity both to observe it and to suffer its effects.

Although social and political turmoil affected Hobbes's life and shaped his thought, it never hampered his intellectual development. His early position as a tutor gave him the scope to read, write and publish (a brilliant translation of the Greek writer Thucydides appeared in 1629), and brought him into contact with notable English intellectuals such as Francis Bacon. His self-imposed exile in France, along with his emerging reputation as a scientist and thinker, brought him into contact with major European intellectual figures of his time, leading to exchange and controversy with figures such as Descartes, Mersenne and Gassendi. Intensely disputatious, Hobbes repeatedly embroiled himself in prolonged arguments with clerics, mathematicians, scientists and philosophers - sometimes to the cost of his intellectual reputation. (For instance, he argued repeatedly that it is possible to "square the circle" - no accident that the phrase is now proverbial for a problem that cannot be solved!) His writing was as undaunted by age and ill health as it was by the events of his times. Though his health slowly failed - from about sixty, he began to suffer "shaking palsy," probably Parkinson’s disease, which steadily worsened - even in his eighties he continued to dictate his thoughts to a secretary, and to defend his quarter in various controversies.

Hobbes gained a reputation in many fields. He was known as a scientist (especially in optics), as a mathematician (especially in geometry), as a translator of the classics, as a writer on law, as a disputant in metaphysics and epistemology; not least, he became notorious for his writings and disputes on religious questions. But it is for his writings on morality and politics that he has, rightly, been most remembered. Without these, scholars might remember Hobbes as an interesting intellectual of the seventeenth century; but few philosophers would even recognize his name.

What are the writings that earned Hobbes his philosophical fame? The first was entitled The Elements of Law (1640); this was Hobbes's attempt to provide arguments supporting the King against his challengers.De Cive [On the Citizen] (1642) has much in common with Elements, and offers a clear, concise statement of Hobbes's moral and political philosophy. His most famous work is Leviathan, a classic of English prose (1651; a slightly altered Latin edition appeared in 1668). Leviathan expands on the argument of De Cive, mostly in terms of its huge second half that deals with questions of religion. Other important works include: De Corpore [On the Body] (1655), which deals with questions of metaphysics;De Homine [On Man] (1657); and Behemoth (published 1682, though written rather earlier), in which Hobbes gives his account of England's Civil Wars. But to understand the essentials of Hobbes’s ideas and system, one can rely on De Cive and Leviathan. It is also worth noting that, although Leviathan is more famous and more often read, De Cive actually gives a much more straightforward account of Hobbes's ideas. Readers whose main interest is in those ideas may wish to skip the next section and go straight to ethics and human nature.

3. Two Intellectual Influences

As well as the political background just stressed, two influences are extremely marked in Hobbes's work. The first is a reaction against religious authority as it had been known, and especially against the scholastic philosophy that accepted and defended such authority. The second is a deep admiration for (and involvement in) the emerging scientific method, alongside an admiration for a much older discipline, geometry. Both influences affected how Hobbes expressed his moral and political ideas. In some areas it's also clear that they significantly affected the ideas themselves.

Hobbes's contempt for scholastic philosophy is boundless. Leviathan and other works are littered with references to the "frequency of insignificant speech" in the speculations of the scholastics, with their combinations of Christian theology and Aristotelian metaphysics. Hobbes's reaction, apart from much savage and sparkling sarcasm, is twofold. In the first place, he makes very strong claims about the proper relation between religion and politics. He was not (as many have charged) an atheist, but he was deadly serious in insisting that theological disputes should be kept out of politics. (He also adopts a strongly materialist metaphysics, that - as his critics were quick to charge - makes it difficult to account for God's existence as a spiritual entity.) For Hobbes, the sovereign should determine the proper forms of religious worship, and citizens never have duties to God that override their duty to obey political authority. Second, this reaction against scholasticism shapes the presentation of Hobbes's own ideas. He insists that terms be clearly defined and relate to actual concrete experiences - part of his empiricism. (Many early sections of Leviathan read rather like a dictionary.) Commentators debate how seriously to take Hobbes's stress on the importance of definition, and whether it embodies a definite philosophical doctrine. What is certain, and more important from the point of view of his moral and political thought, is that he tries extremely hard to avoid any metaphysical categories that don't relate to physical realities (especially the mechanical realities of matter and motion). Commentators further disagree whether Hobbes's often mechanical sounding definitions of human nature and human behavior are actually important in shaping his moral and political ideas - see Materialism versus self-knowledge below.

Hobbes's determination to avoid the "insignificant" (that is, meaningless) speech of the scholastics also overlaps with his admiration for the emerging physical sciences and for geometry. His admiration is not so much for the emerging method of experimental science, but rather for deductive science - science that deduces the workings of things from basic first principles and from true definitions of the basic elements. Hobbes therefore approves a mechanistic view of science and knowledge, one that models itself very much on the clarity and deductive power exhibited in proofs in geometry. It is fair to say that this a priori account of science has found little favor after Hobbes's time. It looks rather like a dead-end on the way to the modern idea of science based on patient observation, theory-building and experiment. Nonetheless, it certainly provided Hobbes with a method that he follows in setting out his ideas about human nature and politics. As presented in Leviathan, especially, Hobbes seems to build from first elements of human perception and reasoning, up to a picture of human motivation and action, to a deduction of the possible forms of political relations and their relative desirability. Once more, it can be disputed whether this method is significant in shaping those ideas, or merely provides Hobbes with a distinctive way of presenting them.

4. Ethics and Human Nature

Hobbes's moral thought is difficult to disentangle from his politics. On his view, what we ought to do depends greatly on the situation in which we find ourselves. Where political authority is lacking (as in his famous natural condition of mankind), our fundamental right seems to be to save our skins, by whatever means we think fit. Where political authority exists, our duty seems to be quite straightforward: to obey those in power.

But we can usefully separate the ethics from the politics if we follow Hobbes's own division. For him ethics is concerned with human nature, while political philosophy deals with what happens when human beings interact. What, then, is Hobbes's view of human nature?

a. Materialism Versus Self-Knowledge

Reading the opening chapters of Leviathan is a confusing business, and the reason for this is already apparent in Hobbes's very short "Introduction." He begins by telling us that the human body is like a machine, and that political organization ("the commonwealth") is like an artificial human being. He ends by saying that the truth of his ideas can be gauged only by self-examination, by looking into our selves to adjudge our characteristic thoughts and passions, which form the basis of all human action. But what is the relationship between these two very different claims? For obviously when we look into our selves we do not see mechanical pushes and pulls. This mystery is hardly answered by Hobbes's method in the opening chapters, where he persists in talking about all manner of psychological phenomena - from emotions to thoughts to whole trains of reasoning – as products of mechanical interactions. (As to what he will say about successful political organization, the resemblance between the commonwealth and a functioning human being is slim indeed. Hobbes's only real point seems to be that there should be a "head" that decides most of the important things that the "body" does.)

Most commentators now agree with an argument made in the 1960's by the political philosopher Leo Strauss. Hobbes draws on his notion of a mechanistic science, that works deductively from first principles, in setting out his ideas about human nature. Science provides him with a distinctive method and some memorable metaphors and similes. What it does not provide - nor could it, given the rudimentary state of physiology and psychology in Hobbes's day - are any decisive or substantive ideas about what human nature really is. Those ideas may have come, as Hobbes also claims, from self-examination. In all likelihood, they actually derived from his reflection on contemporary events and his reading of classics of political history such as Thucydides.

This is not to say that we should ignore Hobbes's ideas on human nature - far from it. But it does mean we should not be misled by scientific imagery that stems from an in fact non-existent science (and also, to some extent, from an unproven and uncertain metaphysics). The point is important mainly when it comes to a central interpretative point in Hobbes's work: whether or not he thinks of human beings as mechanical objects, programmed as it were to pursue their self-interest. Some have suggested that Hobbes's mechanical world-view leaves no room for the influence of moral ideas, that he thinks the only effective influence on our behavior will be incentives of pleasure and pain. But while it is true that Hobbes sometimes says things like this, we should be clear that the ideas fit together only in a metaphorical way. For example, there's no reason why moral ideas shouldn’t "get into" the mechanisms that drive us round (like so many clock-work dolls perhaps?). Likewise, there's no reason why pursuing pleasure and pain should work in our self-interest. (What self-interest is depends on the time-scale we adopt, and how effectively we might achieve this goal also depends on our insight into what harms and benefits us). If we want to know what drives human beings, on Hobbes's view, we must read carefully all he says about this, as well as what he needs to assume if the rest of his thought is to make sense. The mechanistic metaphor is something of a red herring and, in the end, probably less useful than his other starting point inLeviathan, the Delphic epithet: nosce teipsum, "know thyself."

b. The Poverty of Human Judgment and our Need for Science

There are two major aspects to Hobbes's picture of human nature. As we have seen, and will explore below, what motivates human beings to act is extremely important to Hobbes. The other aspect concerns human powers of judgment and reasoning, about which Hobbes tends to be extremely skeptical. Like many philosophers before him, Hobbes wants to present a more solid and certain account of human morality than is contained in everyday beliefs. Plato had contrasted knowledge with opinion. Hobbes contrasts science with a whole raft of less reliable forms of belief - from probable inference based on experience, right down to "absurdity, to which no living creature is subject but man" (Leviathan, v.7).

Hobbes has several reasons for thinking that human judgment is unreliable, and needs to be guided by science. Our judgments tend to be distorted by self-interest or by the pleasures and pains of the moment. We may share the same basic passions, but the various things of the world affect us all very differently; and we are inclined to use our feelings as measures for others. It becomes dogmatic through vanity and morality, as with "men vehemently in love with their own new opinions…and obstinately bent to maintain them, [who give] their opinions also that reverenced name of conscience" (Leviathan, vii.4). When we use words which lack any real objects of reference, or are unclear about the meaning of the words we use, the danger is not only that our thoughts will be meaningless, but also that we will fall into violent dispute. (Hobbes has scholastic philosophy in mind, but he also makes related points about the dangerous effects of faulty political ideas and ideologies.) We form beliefs about supernatural entities, fairies and spirits and so on, and fear follows where belief has gone, further distorting our judgment. Judgment can be swayed this way and that by rhetoric, that is, by the persuasive and "colored" speech of others, who can deliberately deceive us and may well have purposes that go against the common good or indeed our own good. Not least, much judgment is concerned with what we should do now, that is, with future events, "the future being but a fiction of the mind" (Leviathan, iii.7) and therefore not reliably known to us.

For Hobbes, it is only science, "the knowledge of consequences" (Leviathan, v.17), that offers reliable knowledge of the future and overcomes the frailties of human judgment. Unfortunately, his picture of science, based on crudely mechanistic premises and developed through deductive demonstrations, is not even plausible in the physical sciences. When it comes to the complexities of human behavior, Hobbes's model of science is even less satisfactory. He is certainly an acute and wise commentator of political affairs; we can praise him for his hard-headedness about the realities of human conduct, and for his determination to create solid chains of logical reasoning. Nonetheless, this does not mean that Hobbes was able to reach a level of "scientific" certainty in his judgments that had been lacking in all previous reflection on morals and politics.

c. Motivation

The most consequential aspect of Hobbes's account of human nature centers on his ideas about human motivation, and this topic is therefore at the heart of many debates about how to understand Hobbes's philosophy. Many interpreters have presented the Hobbesian agent as a self-interested, rationally calculating actor (those ideas have been important in modern political philosophy and economic thought, especially in terms of rational choice theories). It is true that some of the problems that face people like this - rational egoists, as philosophers call them - are similar to the problems Hobbes wants to solve in his political philosophy. And it is also very common for first-time readers of Hobbes to get the impression that he believes we're all basically selfish.

There are good reasons why earlier interpreters and new readers tend to think the Hobbesian agent is ultimately self-interested. Hobbes likes to make bold and even shocking claims to get his point across. "I obtained two absolutely certain postulates of human nature," he says, "one, the postulate of human greed by which each man insists upon his own private use of common property; the other, the postulate of natural reason, by which each man strives to avoid violent death" (De Cive, Epistle Dedicatory). What could be clearer? - We want all we can get, and we certainly want to avoid death. There are two problems with thinking that this is Hobbes's considered view, however. First, quite simply, it represents a false view of human nature. People do all sorts of altruistic things that go against their interests. They also do all sorts of needlessly cruel things that go against self-interest (think of the self-defeating lengths that revenge can run to). So it would be uncharitable to interpret Hobbes this way, if we can find a more plausible account in his work. Second, in any case Hobbes often relies on a more sophisticated view of human nature. He describes or even relies on motives that go beyond or against self-interest, such as pity, a sense of honor or courage, and so on. And he frequently emphasizes that we find it difficult to judge or appreciate just what our interests are anyhow. (Some also suggest that Hobbes's views on the matter shifted away from egoism after De Cive, but the point is not crucial here.)

The upshot is that Hobbes does not think that we are basically or reliably selfish; and he does not think we are fundamentally or reliably rational in our ideas about what is in our interests. He is rarely surprised to find human beings doing things that go against self-interest: we will cut off our noses to spite our faces, we will torture others for their eternal salvation, we will charge to our deaths for love of country. In fact, a lot of the problems that befall human beings, according to Hobbes, result from their being too littleconcerned with self-interest. Too often, he thinks, we are too much concerned with what others think of us, or inflamed by religious doctrine, or carried away by others' inflammatory words. This weakness as regards our self-interest has even led some to think that Hobbes is advocating a theory known as ethical egoism. This is to claim that Hobbes bases morality upon self-interest, claiming that we ought to do what it is most in our interest to do. But we shall see that this would over-simplify the conclusions that Hobbes draws from his account of human nature.

d. Political Philosophy

This is Hobbes's picture of human nature. We are needy and vulnerable. We are easily led astray in our attempts to know the world around us. Our capacity to reason is as fragile as our capacity to know; it relies upon language and is prone to error and undue influence. When we act, we may do so selfishly or impulsively or in ignorance, on the basis of faulty reasoning or bad theology or others' emotive speech.

What is the political fate of this rather pathetic sounding creature - that is, of us? Unsurprisingly, Hobbes thinks little happiness can be expected of our lives together. The best we can hope for is peaceful life under an authoritarian-sounding sovereign. The worst, on Hobbes's account, is what he calls the "natural condition of mankind," a state of violence, insecurity and constant threat. In outline, Hobbes's argument is that the alternative to government is a situation no one could reasonably wish for, and that any attempt to make government accountable to the people must undermine it, so threatening the situation of non-government that we must all wish to avoid. Our only reasonable option, therefore, is a "sovereign" authority that is totally unaccountable to its subjects. Let us deal with the "natural condition" of non-government, also called the "state of nature," first of all.

5. The Natural Condition of Mankind

The state of nature is "natural" in one specific sense only. For Hobbes political authority is artificial: in the "natural" condition human beings lack government, which is an authority created by men. What is Hobbes's reasoning here? He claims that the only authority that naturally exists among human beings is that of a mother over her child, because the child is so very much weaker than the mother (and indebted to her for its survival). Among adult human beings this is invariably not the case. Hobbes concedes an obvious objection, admitting that some of us are much stronger than others. And although he's very sarcastic about the idea that some are wiser than others, he doesn't have much difficulty with the idea that some are fools and others are dangerously cunning. Nonetheless, it's almost invariably true that every human being is capable of killing any other. Even the strongest must sleep; even the weakest might persuade others to help him kill another. (Leviathan, xiii.1-2) Because adults are "equal" in this capacity to threaten one another’s lives, Hobbes claims there is no natural source of authority to order their lives together. (He is strongly opposing arguments that established monarchs have a natural or God-given right to rule over us.)

Thus, as long as human beings have not successfully arranged some form of government, they live in Hobbes's state of nature. Such a condition might occur at the "beginning of time" (see Hobbes’s comments on Cain and Abel, Leviathan, xiii.11, Latin version only), or in "primitive" societies (Hobbes thought the American Indians lived in such a condition). But the real point for Hobbes is that a state of nature could just as well occur in seventeenth century England, should the King's authority be successfully undermined. It could occur tomorrow in every modern society, for example, if the police and army suddenly refused to do their jobs on behalf of government. Unless some effective authority stepped into the King's place (or the place of army and police and government), Hobbes argues the result is doomed to be deeply awful, nothing less than a state of war.

Why should peaceful cooperation be impossible without an overarching authority? Hobbes provides a series of powerful arguments that suggest it is extremely unlikely that human beings will live in security and peaceful cooperation without government. (Anarchism, the thesis that we should live without government, of course disputes these arguments.) His most basic argument is threefold. (Leviathan, xiii.3-9) (i) He thinks we will compete, violently compete, to secure the basic necessities of life and perhaps to make other material gains. (ii) He argues that we will challenge others and fight out of fear ("diffidence"), so as to ensure our personal safety. (iii) And he believes that we will seek reputation ("glory"), both for its own sake and for its protective effects (for example, so that others will be afraid to challenge us).

This is a more difficult argument than it might seem. Hobbes does not suppose that we are all selfish, that we are all cowards, or that we are all desperately concerned with how others see us. Two points, though. First, he does think that some of us are selfish, some of us cowardly, and some of us "vainglorious" (perhaps some people are of all of these!). Moreover, many of these people will be prepared to use violence to attain their ends - especially if there's no government or police to stop them. In this Hobbes is surely correct. Second, in some situations it makes good sense, at least in the short term, to use violence and to behave selfishly, fearfully or vaingloriously. If our lives seem to be at stake, after all, we're unlikely to have many scruples about stealing a loaf of bread; if we perceive someone as a deadly threat, we may well want to attack first, while his guard is down; if we think that there are lots of potential attackers out there, it's going to make perfect sense to get a reputation as someone who shouldn't be messed with. In Hobbes’s words, "the wickedness of bad men also compels good men to have recourse, for their own protection, to the virtues of war, which are violence and fraud." (De Cive, Epistle Dedicatory) As well as being more complex than first appears, Hobbes's argument becomes very difficult to refute.

Underlying this most basic argument is an important consideration about insecurity. As we shall see Hobbes places great weight on contracts (thus some interpreters see Hobbes as heralding a market society dominated by contractual exchanges). In particular, he often speaks of "covenants," by which he means a contract where one party performs his part of the bargain later than the other. In the state of nature such agreements aren't going to work. Only the weakest will have good reason to perform the second part of a covenant, and then only if the stronger party is standing over them. Yet a huge amount of human cooperation relies on trust, that others will return their part of the bargain over time. A similar point can be made about property, most of which we can't carry about with us and watch over. This means we must rely on others respecting our possessions over extended periods of time. If we can't do this, then many of the achievements of human society that involve putting hard work into land (farming, building) or material objects (the crafts, or modern industrial production, still unknown in Hobbes's time) will be near impossible.

One can reasonably object to such points: Surely there are basic duties to reciprocate fairly and to behave in a trustworthy manner? Even if there's no government providing a framework of law, judgment and punishment, don't most people have a reasonable sense of what is right and wrong, which will prevent the sort of contract-breaking and generalized insecurity that Hobbes is concerned with? Indeed, shouldn't our basic sense of morality prevent much of the greed, pre-emptive attack and reputation-seeking that Hobbes stressed in the first place? This is the crunch point of Hobbes's argument, and it is here (if anywhere) that one can accuse Hobbes of "pessimism." He makes two claims. The first concerns our duties in the state of nature (that is, the so-called "right of nature"). The second follows from this, and is less often noticed: it concerns the danger posed by our different and variable judgments of what is right and wrong.

On Hobbes's view the right of nature is quite simple to define. Naturally speaking - that is, outside of civil society – we have a right to do whatever we think will ensure our self-preservation. The worst that can happen to us is violent death at the hands of others. If we have any rights at all, if (as we might put it) nature has given us any rights whatsoever, then the first is surely this: the right to prevent violent death befalling us. But Hobbes says more than this, and it is this point that makes his argument so powerful. We do not just have a right to ensure our self-preservation: we each have a right to judge what will ensure our self-preservation. And this is where Hobbes's picture of humankind becomes important. Hobbes has given us good reasons to think that human beings rarely judge wisely. Yet in the state of nature no one is in a position to successfully define what is good judgment. If I judge that killing you is a sensible or even necessary move to safeguard my life, then - in Hobbes's state of nature – I have a right to kill you. Others might judge the matter differently, of course. Almost certainly you'll have quite a different view of things (perhaps you were just stretching your arms, not raising a musket to shoot me). Because we're all insecure, because trust is more-or-less absent, there's little chance of our sorting out misunderstandings peacefully, nor can we rely on some (trusted) third party to decide whose judgment is right. We all have to be judges in our own causes, and the stakes are very high indeed: life or death.

For this reason Hobbes makes very bold claims that sound totally amoral. "To this war of every man against every man," he says, "this also is consequent [i.e., it follows]: that nothing can be unjust. The notions of right and wrong, justice and injustice have no place [in the state of nature]." (Leviathan, xiii.13) He further argues that in the state of nature we each have a right to all things, "even to one another's body’ (Leviathan, xiv.4). Hobbes is dramatizing his point, but the core is defensible. If I judge that I need such and such - an object, another person's labor, another person’s death - to ensure my continued existence, then in the state of nature, there is no agreed authority to decide whether I'm right or wrong. New readers of Hobbes often suppose that the state of nature would be a much nicer place, if only he were to picture human beings with some basic moral ideas. But this is naïve: unless people share the same moral ideas, not just at the level of general principles but also at the level of individual judgment, then the challenge he poses remains unsolved: human beings who lack some shared authority are almost certain to fall into dangerous and deadly conflict.

There are different ways of interpreting Hobbes's view of the absence of moral constraints in the state of nature. Some think that Hobbes is imagining human beings who have no idea of social interaction and therefore no ideas about right and wrong. In this case, the natural condition would be a purely theoretical construction, and would demonstrate what both government and society do for human beings. (A famous statement about the state of nature in De Cive (viii.1) might support this interpretation: "looking at men as if they had just emerged from the earth like mushrooms and grown up without any obligation to each other…") Another, complementary view reads Hobbes as a psychological egoist, so that - in the state of nature as elsewhere – he is merely describing the interaction of ultimately selfish and amoral human beings.

Others suppose that Hobbes has a much more complex picture of human motivation, so that there is no reason to think moral ideas are absent in the state of nature. In particular, it's historically reasonable to think that Hobbes invariably has civil war in mind, when he describes our "natural condition." If we think of civil war, we need to imagine people who’ve lived together and indeed still do live together - huddled together in fear in their houses, banded together as armies or guerrillas or groups of looters. The problem here isn't a lack of moral ideas - far from it – rather that moral ideas and judgments differ enormously. This means (for example) that two people who are fighting tooth and nail over a cow or a gun can both think they're perfectly entitled to the object and both think they're perfectly right to kill the other - a point Hobbes makes explicitly and often. It also enables us to see that many Hobbesian conflicts are about religious ideas or political ideals (as well as self-preservation and so on) - as in the British Civil War raging while Hobbes wrote Leviathan, and in the many violent sectarian conflicts throughout the world today.

In the end, though, whatever account of the state of nature and its (a) morality we attribute to Hobbes, we must remember that it is meant to function as a powerful and decisive threat: if we do not heed Hobbes's teachings and fail to respect existing political authority, then the natural condition and its horrors of war await us.

a. The Laws of Nature and the Social Contract

Hobbes thinks the state of nature is something we ought to avoid, at any cost except our own self-preservation (this being our "right of nature," as we saw above). But what sort of "ought" is this? There are two basic ways of interpreting Hobbes here. It might be a counsel of prudence: avoid the state of nature, if you're concerned to avoid violent death. In this case Hobbes's advice only applies to us (i) if we agree that violent death is what we should fear most and should therefore avoid; and (ii) if we agree with Hobbes that only an unaccountable sovereign stands between human beings and the state of nature. This line of thought fits well with an egoistic reading of Hobbes, but we'll see that it faces serious problems.

The other way of interpreting Hobbes is not without problems either. This takes Hobbes to be saying that we ought, morally speaking, to avoid the state of nature. We have a duty to do what we can to avoid this situation arising, and a duty to end it, if at all possible. Hobbes often makes his view clear, that we have such moral obligations. But then two difficult questions arise: Why these obligations? And why are they obligatory?

Hobbes frames the issues in terms of an older vocabulary, using the idea of natural law that many ancient and medieval philosophers had relied on. Like them, he thinks that human reason can discern some eternal principles to govern our conduct. These principles are independent of (though also complementary to) whatever moral instruction we might get from God or religion. In other words, they are laws given by nature rather than revealed by God. But Hobbes makes radical changes to the content of these so-called laws of nature. In particular, he doesn't think that natural law provides any scope whatsoever to criticize or disobey the actual laws made by a government. He thus disagrees with those Protestants who thought that religious conscience might sanction disobedience of "immoral" laws, and with Catholics who thought that the commandments of the Pope have primacy over those of national political authorities.

Although he sets out nineteen laws of nature, it is the first two that are politically crucial. A third, that stresses the important of keeping to contracts we have entered into, is important in Hobbes's moral justifications of obedience to the sovereign. (The remaining sixteen can be quite simply encapsulated in the formula, "do as you would be done by." While the details are important for scholars of Hobbes, they do not affect the overall theory and will be ignored here.)

The first law reads as follows:

Every man ought to endeavor peace, as far as he has hope of obtaining it, and when he cannot obtain it, that he may seek and use all helps and advantages of war. (Leviathan, xiv.4)

This repeats the points we have already seen about our "right of nature," so long as peace does not appear to be a realistic prospect. The second law of nature is more complicated:

That a man be willing, when others are so too, as far-forth as for peace and defense of himself he shall think it necessary, to lay down this right to all things, and be contented with so much liberty against other men, as he would allow other men against himself. (Leviathan, xiv.5)

What Hobbes tries to tackle here is the transition from the state of nature to civil society. But how he does this is misleading and has generated much confusion and disagreement. The way that Hobbes describes this second law of nature makes it look as if we should all put down our weapons, give up (much of) our "right of nature," and jointly authorize a sovereign who will tell us what is permitted and punish us if we don't obey. But the problem is obvious. If the state of nature is anything like as bad as Hobbes has argued, then there's just no way people could ever make an agreement like this or put it into practice.

At the end of Leviathan, Hobbes seems to concede this point, saying "there is scarce a commonwealth in the world whose beginnings can in conscience be justified" ("Review and Conclusion," 8). That is: governments have invariably been foisted upon people by force and fraud, not by collective agreement. But Hobbes means to defend every existing government that is powerful enough to secure peace among its subjects - not just a mythical government that's been created by a peaceful contract out of a state of nature. His basic claim is that we should behave as if we had voluntarily entered into such a contract with everyone else in our society - everyone else, that is, except the sovereign authority.

In Hobbes's myth of the social contract, everyone except the person or group who will wield sovereign power lays down their "right to all things." They agree to limit drastically their right of nature, retaining only a right to defend their lives in case of immediate threat. (How limited this right of nature becomes in civil society has caused much dispute, because deciding what is an immediate threat is a question of judgment. It certainly permits us to fight back if the sovereign tries to kill us. But what if the sovereign conscripts us as soldiers? What if the sovereign looks weak and we doubt whether he can continue to secure peace…?) The sovereign, however, retains his (or her, or their) right of nature, which we have seen is effectively a right to all things - to decide what everyone else should do, to decide the rules of property, to judge disputes and so on. Hobbes concedes that there are moral limits on what sovereigns should do (God might call a sovereign to account). However, since in any case of dispute the sovereign is the only rightful judge - on this earth, that is – those moral limits make no practical difference. In every moral and political matter, the decisive question for Hobbes is always: who is to judge? As we have seen, in the state of nature, each of us is judge in our own cause, part of the reason why Hobbes thinks it is inevitably a state of war. Once civil society exists, the only rightful judge is the sovereign.

b. Why Should we Obey the Sovereign?

If we had all made a voluntary contract, a mutual promise, then it might seem half-way plausible to think we have an obligation to obey the sovereign (although even this requires the claim that promising is a moral value that overrides all others). If we have been conquered or, more fortunately, have simply been born into a society with an established political authority, this seems quite improbable. Hobbes has to make three steps here, all of which have seemed weak to many of his readers. First of all, he insists that promises made under threat of violence are nonetheless freely made, and just as binding as any others. Second, he has to put great weight on the moral value of promise keeping, which hardly fits with the absence of duties in the state of nature. Third, he has to give a story of how those of us born and raised in a political society have made some sort of implied promise to each other to obey, or at least, he has to show that we are bound (either morally or out of self-interest) to behave as if we had made such a promise.

In the first place, Hobbes draws on his mechanistic picture of the world, to suggest that threats of force do not deprive us of liberty. Liberty, he says, is freedom of motion, and I am free to move whichever way I wish, unless I am literally enchained. If I yield to threats of violence, that is my choice, for physically I could have done otherwise. If I obey the sovereign for fear of punishment or in fear of the state of nature, then that is equally my choice. Such obedience then comes, for Hobbes, to constitute a promise that I will continue to obey.

Second, promises carry a huge moral weight for Hobbes, as they do in all social contract theories. The question, however, is why we should think they are so important. Why should my (coerced) promise oblige me, given the wrong you committed in threatening me and demanding my valuables? Hobbes has no good answer to this question (but see below, on egoistic interpretations of Hobbes's thinking here). His theory suggests that (in the state of nature) you could do me no wrong, as the right of nature dictates that we all have a right to all things. Likewise, promises do not oblige in the state of nature, inasmuch as they go against our right of nature. In civil society, the sovereign's laws dictate what is right and wrong; if your threat was wrongful, then my promise will not bind me. But as the sovereign is outside of the original contract, he sets the terms for everyone else: so his threats create obligations.

As this suggests, Hobbesian promises are strangely fragile. Implausibly binding so long as a sovereign exists to adjudicate and enforce them, they lose all power should things revert to a state of nature. Relatedly, they seem to contain not one jot of loyalty. To be logically consistent, Hobbes needs to be politically implausible. Now there are passages where Hobbes sacrifices consistency for plausibility, arguing we have a duty to fight for our (former) sovereign even in the midst of civil war. Nonetheless the logic of his theory suggests that, as soon as government starts to weaken and disorder sets in, our duty of obedience lapses. That is, when the sovereign power needs our support, because it is no longer able to coerce us, there is no effective judge or enforcer of covenants, so that such promises no longer override our right of nature. This turns common sense on its head. Surely a powerful government can afford to be challenged, for instance by civil disobedience or conscientious objection? But when civil conflict and the state of nature threaten, in other words when government is failing, then we might reasonably think that political unity is as morally important as Hobbes always suggests. A similar question of loyalty also comes up when the sovereign power has been usurped - when Cromwell has supplanted the King, when a foreign invader has ousted our government. Right from the start, Hobbes's critics saw that his theory makes turncoats into moral heroes: our allegiance belongs to whoever happens to be holding the gun(s). Perversely, the only crime the makers of a coup can commit is to fail.

Why does this problem come about? To overcome the fact that his contract is a fiction, Hobbes is driven to construct a "sort of" promise out of the fact of our subjugation to whatever political authority exists. He stays wedded to the idea that obedience can only find a moral basis in a "voluntary" promise, because only this seems to justify the almost unlimited obedience and renunciation of individual judgment he's determined to prove. It is no surprise that Hobbes's arguments creak at every point: nothing could bear the weight of justifying such an overriding duty.

All the difficulties in finding a reliable moral obligation to obey might tempt us back to the idea that Hobbes is some sort of egoist. However, the difficulties with this tack are even greater. There are two sorts of egoism commentators have attributed to Hobbes: psychological and ethical. The first theory says that human beings always act egoistically, the second that they ought to act egoistically. Either view might support this simple idea: we should obey the sovereign, because his political authority is what keeps us from the evils of the natural condition. But the basic problem with such egoistic interpretations, from the point of view of Hobbes's system of politics, is shown when we think about cases where selfishness seems to conflict with the commands of the sovereign - for example, where illegal conduct will benefit us or keep us from danger. For a psychologically egoist agent, such behavior will be irresistible; for an ethically egoist agent, it will be morally obligatory. Now, providing the sovereign is sufficiently powerful and well-informed, he can prevent many such cases arising by threatening and enforcing punishments of those who disobey. Effective threats of punishment mean that obedience is in our self-interest. But such threats will not be effective when we think our disobedience can go undetected. After Orwell's 1984 we can imagine a state that is so powerful that no reasonable person would ever think disobedience could pay. But for Hobbes, such a powerful sovereign was not even conceivable: he would have had to assume that there would be many situations where people could reasonably hope to "get away with it." (Likewise, under non-totalitarian, liberal politics, there are many situations where illegal behavior is very unlikely to be detected or punished.) So, still thinking of egoistic agents, the more people do get away with it, the more reason others have to think they can do the same. Thus the problem of disobedience threatens to "snowball," undermining the sovereign and plunging selfish agents back into the chaos of the state of nature.

In other words, sovereignty as Hobbes imagined it, and liberal political authority as we know it, can only function where people feel some additional motivation apart from pure self-interest. Moreover, there is strong evidence that Hobbes was well aware of this. Part of Hobbes's interest in religion (a topic that occupies half of Leviathan) lies in its power to shape human conduct. Sometimes this does seem to work through self-interest, as in crude threats of damnation and hell-fire. But Hobbes's main interest lies in the educative power of religion, and indeed of political authority. Religious practices, the doctrines taught in the universities (!), the beliefs and habits inculcated by the institutions of government and society: how these can encourage and secure respect for law and authority seem to be even more important to Hobbes's political solutions than his theoretical social contract or shaky appeals to simple self-interest.

What are we to conclude, then, given the difficulties in finding a reliable moral or selfish justification for obedience? In the end, for Hobbes, everything rides on the value of peace. Hobbes wants to say both that civil order is in our "enlightened" self-interest, and that it is of overwhelming moral value. Life is never going to be perfect for us, and life under the sovereign is the best we can do. Recognizing this aspect ofeveryone's self-interest should lead us to recognize the moral value of supporting whatever authority we happen to live under. For Hobbes, this moral value is so great - and the alternatives so stark – that it should override every threat to our self-interest except the imminent danger of death. The million-dollar question is then: is a life of obedience to the sovereign really the best human beings can hope for?

c. Life Under the Sovereign

Hobbes has definite ideas about the proper nature, scope and exercise of sovereignty. Much that he says is cogent, and much of it can reduce the worries we might have about living under this drastically authoritarian sounding regime. Many commentators have stressed, for example, the importance Hobbes places upon the rule of law. His claim that much of our freedom, in civil society, "depends on the silence of the laws" is often quoted (Leviathan, xxi.18). In addition, Hobbes makes many points that are obviously aimed at contemporary debates about the rights of King and Parliament - especially about the sovereign's rights as regards taxation and the seizure of property, and about the proper relation between religion and politics. Some of these points continue to be relevant, others are obviously anachronistic: evidently Hobbes could not have imagined the modern state, with its vast bureaucracies, massive welfare provision and complicated interfaces with society. Nor could he have foreseen how incredibly powerful the state might become, meaning that "sovereigns" such as Hitler or Stalin might starve, brutalize and kill their subjects, to such an extent that the state of nature looks clearly preferable.

However, the problem with all of Hobbes's notions about sovereignty is that - on his account – it is not Hobbes the philosopher, nor we the citizens, who decide what counts as the proper nature, scope or exercise of sovereignty. He faces a systematic problem: justifying any limits or constraints on the sovereign involves making judgments about moral or practical requirements. But one of his greatest insights, still little recognized by many moral philosophers, is that any right or entitlement is only practically meaningful when combined with a concrete judgment as to what it dictates in some given case. Hobbes's own failure, however understandable, to foresee the growth of government and its powers only supports this thought: that the proper nature, scope or exercise of sovereignty is a matter of complex judgment. Alone among the people who comprise Hobbes's commonwealth, it is the sovereign who judges what form he should appear in, how far he should reach into the lives of his subjects, and how he should exercise his powers.

It should be added that the one part of his system that Hobbes concedes not to be proven with certainty is just this question: who or what should constitute the sovereign power. It was natural for Hobbes to think of a King, or indeed a Queen (he was born under Elizabeth I). But he was certainly very familiar with ancient forms of government, including aristocracy (government by an elite) and democracy (government by the citizens, who formed a relatively small group within the total population). Hobbes was also aware that an assembly such as Parliament could constitute a sovereign body. All have advantages and disadvantages, he argues. But the unity that comes about from having a single person at the apex, together with fixed rules of succession that pre-empt dispute about who this person should be, makes monarchy Hobbes's preferred option.

In fact, if we want to crack open Hobbes's sovereign, to be able to lay down concrete ideas about its nature and limits, we must begin with the question of judgment. For Hobbes, dividing capacities to judge between different bodies is tantamount to letting the state of nature straight back in. "For what is it to divide the power of a commonwealth, but to dissolve it; for powers divided mutually destroy each other." (Leviathan, xxix.12; cf De Cive, xii.5) Beyond the example of England in the 1640s, Hobbes hardly bothers to argue the point, although it is crucial to his entire theory. Always in his mind is the Civil War that arose when Parliament claimed the right to judge rules of taxation, and thereby prevented the King from ruling and making war as he saw fit, and when churches and religious sects claimed prerogatives that went against the King's decisions.

Especially given modern experiences of the division of powers, however, it's easy to see that these examples are extreme and atypical. We might recall the American constitution, where powers of legislation, execution and case-by-case judgment are separated (to Congress, President and the judiciary respectively) and counter-balance one another. Each of these bodies is responsible for judging different questions. There are often, of course, boundary disputes, as to whether legislative, executive or judicial powers should apply to a given issue, and no one body is empowered to settle this crucial question of judgment. Equally obviously, however, such disputes have not led to a state of nature (well, at least if we think of the US after the Civil War). For Hobbes it is simply axiomatic that disputation as to who should judge important social and political issues spells the end of the commonwealth. For us, it is equally obvious that only a few extreme forms of dispute have this very dangerous power. Dividing the powers that are important to government need not leave a society more open to those dangerous conflicts. Indeed, many would now argue that political compromises which provide different groups and bodies with independent space to judge certain social or political issues can be crucial for preventing disputes from escalating into violent conflict or civil war.

6. Conclusion

What happens, then, if we do not follow Hobbes in his arguments that judgment must, by necessity or by social contract or both, be the sole province of the sovereign? If we are optimists about the power of human judgment, and about the extent of moral consensus among human beings, we have a straightforward route to the concerns of modern liberalism. Our attention will not be on the question of social and political order, rather on how to maximize liberty, how to define social justice, how to draw the limits of government power, and how to realize democratic ideals. We will probably interpret Hobbes as a psychological egoist, and think that the problems of political order that obsessed him were the product of an unrealistic view of human nature, or unfortunate historical circumstances, or both. In this case, I suggest, we might as well not have read Hobbes at all.

If we are less optimistic about human judgment in morals and politics, however, we should not doubt that Hobbes's problems remain our problems. But hindsight shows grave limitations to his solutions. Theoretically, Hobbes fails to prove that we have an almost unlimited obligation to obey the sovereign. His arguments that sovereignty - the power to judge moral and political matters, and enforce those judgments - cannot be divided are not only weak; they are simply refuted by the (relatively) successful distribution of powers in modern liberal societies. Not least, the horrific crimes of twentieth century dictatorships show beyond doubt that judgment about right and wrong cannot be a question only for our political leaders.

If Hobbes's problems are real and his solutions only partly convincing, where will we go? It might reasonably be thought that this is the central question of modern political thought. We will have no doubt that peaceful coexistence is one of the greatest goods of human life, something worth many inconveniences, sacrifices and compromises. We will see that there is moral force behind the laws and requirements of the state, simply because human beings do indeed need authority and systems of enforcement if they are to cooperate peacefully. But we can hardly accept that, because human judgment is weak and faulty, that there can be only one judge of these matters - precisely because that judge might turn out to be very faulty indeed. Our concern will be how we can effectively divide power between government and people, while still ensuring that important questions of moral and political judgment are peacefully adjudicated. We will be concerned with the standards and institutions that provide for compromise between many different and conflicting judgments. And all the time, we will remember Hobbes's reminder that human life is never without inconvenience and troubles, that we must live with a certain amount of bad, to prevent the worst: fear of violence, and violent death.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Edwards, Alistair (2002) "Hobbes" in Interpreting Modern Political Philosophy: From Machiavelli to Marx, eds. A Edwards and J Townshend (Palgrave Macmillan, Houndmills)
    • A very helpful overview of key interpretative debates about Hobbes in the twentieth century.
  • Hill, Christopher (1961/1980) The Century of Revolution, 1603-1714, second ed (Routledge, London)
    • The classic work on the history and repercussions of England's civil war.
  • Hobbes, Thomas (1998 [1642]) On the Citizen, ed & trans Richard Tuck and Michael Silverthorne (Cambridge University Press, Cambridge)
    • The best translation of Hobbes's most straightforward book,De Cive.
  • Hobbes, Thomas (1994 [1651/1668]) Leviathan, ed Edwin Curley (Hackett, Indianapolis)
    • The best edition of Hobbes's magnum opus, including extensive additional material and many important variations (ignored by all other editions) between the English text and later Latin edition.
  • Sorrell, Tom (1986) Hobbes (Routledge & Kegan Paul, London)
    • A concise and well-judged account of Hobbes's life and works.
  • Sorrell, Tom, ed (1996) The Cambridge Companion to Hobbes (Cambridge University Press, Cambridge)
    • An excellent set of essays on all aspects of Hobbes's intellectual endeavors.

Author Information

Garrath Williams
Lancaster University
United Kingdom

Human Rights

Human rights are certain moral guarantees. This article examines the philosophical basis and content of the doctrine of human rights. The analysis consists of five sections and a conclusion. Section one assesses the contemporary significance of human rights, and argues that the doctrine of human rights has become the dominant moral doctrine for evaluating the moral status of the contemporary geo-political order. Section two proceeds to chart the historical development of the concept of human rights, beginning with a discussion of the earliest philosophical origins of the philosophical bases of human rights and culminating in some of most recent developments in the codification of human rights. Section three considers the philosophical concept of a human right and analyses the formal and substantive distinctions philosophers have drawn between various forms and categories of rights. Section four addresses the question of how philosophers have sought to justify the claims of human rights and specifically charts the arguments presented by the two presently dominant approaches in this field: interest theory and will theory. Section five then proceeds to discuss some of the main criticisms currently levelled at the doctrine of human rights and highlights some of the main arguments of those who have challenged the universalist and objectivist bases of human rights. Finally, a brief conclusion is presented, summarising the main themes addressed.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction: the contemporary significance of human rights
  2. Historical origins and development of the theory and practice of human rights
  3. Philosophical analysis of the concept of human rights
    1. Moral vs. Legal Rights
    2. Claim Rights & Liberty Rights
    3. Substantive categories of human rights
    4. Scope of human rights duties
  4. Philosophical justifications of human rights
    1. Do human rights require philosophical justification?
    2. The interests theory approach
    3. The Will Theory Approach
  5. Philosophical criticisms of human rights
    1. Moral relativism
    2. Epistemological criticisms of human rights
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction: the contemporary significance of human rights

Human rights have been defined as

basic moral guarantees that people in all countries and cultures allegedly have simply because they are people. Calling these guarantees "rights" suggests that they attach to particular individuals who can invoke them, that they are of high priority, and that compliance with them is mandatory rather than discretionary. Human rights are frequently held to be universal in the sense that all people have and should enjoy them, and to be independent in the sense that they exist and are available as standards of justification and criticism whether or not they are recognized and implemented by the legal system or officials of a country. (Nickel, 1992:561-2)

The moral doctrine of human rights aims at identifying the fundamental prerequisites for each human being leading a minimally good life. Human rights aim to identify both the necessary negative and positive prerequisites for leading a minimally good life, such as rights against torture and rights to health care. This aspiration has been enshrined in various declarations and legal conventions issued during the past fifty years, initiated by the Universal Declaration of Human Rights (1948) and perpetuated by, most importantly, the European Convention on Human Rights (1954) and the International Covenant on Civil and Economic Rights (1966). Together these three documents form the centrepiece of a moral doctrine that many consider to be capable of providing the contemporary geo-political order with what amounts to an international bill of rights. However, the doctrine of human rights does not aim to be a fully comprehensive moral doctrine. An appeal to human rights does not provide us with a fully comprehensive account of morality per se. Human rights do not, for example, provide us with criteria for answering such questions as whether telling lies is inherently immoral, or what the extent of one's moral obligations to friends and lovers ought to be? What human rights do primarily aim to identify is the basis for determining the shape, content, and scope of fundamental, public moral norms. As James Nickel states, human rights aim to secure for individuals the necessary conditions for leading a minimally good life. Public authorities, both national and international, are identified as typically best placed to secure these conditions and so, the doctrine of human rights has become, for many, a first port of moral call for determining the basic moral guarantees all of us have a right to expect, both of one another but also, primarily, of those national and international institutions capable of directly affecting our most important interests. The doctrine of human rights aspires to provide the contemporary, allegedly post-ideological, geo-political order with a common framework for determining the basic economic, political, and social conditions required for all individuals to lead a minimally good life. While the practical efficacy of promoting and protecting human rights is significantly aided by individual nation-states' legally recognising the doctrine, the ultimate validity of human rights is characteristically thought of as not conditional upon such recognition. The moral justification of human rights is thought to precede considerations of strict national sovereignty. An underlying aspiration of the doctrine of human rights is to provide a set of legitimate criteria to which all nation-states should adhere. Appeals to national sovereignty should not provide a legitimate means for nation-states to permanently opt out of their fundamental human rights-based commitments. Thus, the doctrine of human rights is ideally placed to provide individuals with a powerful means for morally auditing the legitimacy of those contemporary national and international forms of political and economic authority which confront us and which claim jurisdiction over us. This is no small measure of the contemporary moral and political significance of the doctrine of human rights. For many of its most strident supporters, the doctrine of human rights aims to provide a fundamentally legitimate moral basis for regulating the contemporary geo-political order.

2. Historical origins and development of the theory and practice of human rights

The doctrine of human rights rests upon a particularly fundamental philosophical claim: that there exists a rationally identifiable moral order, an order whose legitimacy precedes contingent social and historical conditions and applies to all human beings everywhere and at all times. On this view, moral beliefs and concepts are capable of being objectively validated as fundamentally and universally true. The contemporary doctrine of human rights is one of a number of universalist moral perspectives. The origins and development of the theory of human rights is inextricably tied to the development of moral universalism. The history of the philosophical development of human rights is punctuated by a number of specific moral doctrines which, though not themselves full and adequate expressions of human rights, have nevertheless provided a number of philosophical prerequisites for the contemporary doctrine. These include a view of morality and justice as emanating from some pre-social domain, the identification of which provides the basis for distinguishing between 'true' and merely ‘conventional’ moral principles and beliefs. The essential prerequisites for a defence of human rights also include a conception of the individual as the bearer of certain 'natural' rights and a particular view of the inherent and equal moral worth of each rational individual. I shall discuss each in turn.

Human rights rest upon moral universalism and the belief in the existence of a truly universal moral community comprising all human beings. Moral universalism posits the existence of rationally identifiable trans-cultural and trans-historical moral truths. The origins of moral universalism within Europe are typically associated with the writings of Aristotle and the Stoics. Thus, in his Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle unambiguously expounds an argument in support of the existence of a natural moral order. This natural order ought to provide the basis for all truly rational systems of justice. An appeal to the natural order provides a set of comprehensive and potentially universal criteria for evaluating the legitimacy of actual 'man-made' legal systems. In distinguishing between ‘natural justice' and 'legal justice’, Aristotle writes, ‘the natural is that which has the same validity everywhere and does not depend upon acceptance.' (Nicomachean Ethics, 189) Thus, the criteria for determining a truly rational system of justice pre-exist social and historical conventions. 'Natural justice' pre-exists specific social and political configurations. The means for determining the form and content of natural justice is the exercise of reason free from the distorting effects of mere prejudice or desire. This basic idea was similarly expressed by the Roman Stoics, such as Cicero and Seneca, who argued that morality originated in the rational will of God and the existence of a cosmic city from which one could discern a natural, moral law whose authority transcended all local legal codes. The Stoics' argued that this ethically universal code imposed upon all of us a duty to obey the will of god. The Stoics thereby posited the existence of a universal moral community effected through our shared relationship with god. The belief in the existence of a universal moral community was maintained in Europe by Christianity over the ensuing centuries. While some have discerned intimations towards the notion of rights in the writings of Aristotle, the Stoics, and Christian theologians, a concept of rights approximating that of the contemporary idea of human rights most clearly emerges during the 17th. And 18th. Centuries in Europe and the so-called doctrine of natural law.

The basis of the doctrine of natural law is the belief in the existence of a natural moral code based upon the identification of certain fundamental and objectively verifiable human goods. Our enjoyment of these basic goods is to be secured by our possession of equally fundamental and objectively verifiable natural rights. Natural law was deemed to pre-exist actual social and political systems. Natural rights were thereby similarly presented as rights individuals possessed independently of society or polity. Natural rights were thereby presented as ultimately valid irrespective of whether they had achieved the recognition of any given political ruler or assembly. The quintessential exponent of this position was the 17th. Century philosopher John Locke and, in particular, the argument he outlined in his Two Treatises of Government (1688). At the centre of Locke's argument is the claim that individuals possess natural rights, independently of the political recognition granted them by the state. These natural rights are possessed independently of, and prior to, the formation of any political community. Locke argued that natural rights flowed from natural law. Natural law originated from God. Accurately discerning the will of God provided us with an ultimately authoritative moral code. At root, each of us owes a duty of self-preservation to God. In order to successfully discharge this duty of self-preservation each individual had to be free from threats to life and liberty, whilst also requiring what Locke presented as the basic, positive means for self-preservation: personal property. Our duty of self-preservation to god entailed the necessary existence of basic natural rights to life, liberty, and property. Locke proceeded to argue that the principal purpose of the investiture of political authority in a sovereign state was the provision and protection of individuals' basic natural rights. For Locke, the protection and promotion of individuals’ natural rights was the sole justification for the creation of government. The natural rights to life, liberty, and property set clear limits to the authority and jurisdiction of the State. States were presented as existing to serve the interests, the natural rights, of the people, and not of a Monarch or a ruling cadre. Locke went so far as to argue that individuals are morally justified in taking up arms against their government should it systematically and deliberately fail in its duty to secure individuals' possession of natural rights.

Analyses of the historical predecessors of the contemporary theory of human rights typically accord a high degree of importance to Locke's contribution. Certainly, Locke provided the precedent of establishing legitimate political authority upon a rights foundation. This is an undeniably essential component of human rights. However, the philosophically adequate completion of theoretical basis of human rights requires an account of moral reasoning, that is both consistent with the concept of rights, but which does not necessarily require an appeal to the authority of some super-human entity in justifying human beings' claims to certain, fundamental rights. The 18th. Century German philosopher, Immanuel Kant provides such an account.

Many of the central themes first expressed within Kant's moral philosophy remain highly prominent in contemporary philosophical justifications of human rights. Foremost amongst these are the ideals of equality and the moral autonomy of rational human beings. Kant bestows upon contemporary human rights' theory the ideal of a potentially universal community of rational individuals autonomously determining the moral principles for securing the conditions for equality and autonomy. Kant provides a means for justifying human rights as the basis for self-determination grounded within the authority of human reason. Kant's moral philosophy is based upon an appeal to the formal principles of ethics, rather than, for example, an appeal to a concept of substantive human goods. For Kant, the determination of any such goods can only proceed from a correct determination of the formal properties of human reason and thus do not provide the ultimate means for determining the correct ends, or object, of human reason. Kant's moral philosophy begins with an attempt to correctly identify those principles of reasoning that can be applied equally to all rational persons, irrespective of their own specific desires or partial interests. In this way, Kant attaches a condition of universality to the correct identification of moral principles. For him, the basis of moral reasoning must rest upon a condition that all rational individuals are bound to assent to. Doing the right thing is thus not determined by acting in pursuit of one's own interests or desires, but acting in accordance with a maxim which all rational individuals are bound to accept. Kant terms this the categorical imperative, which he formulates in the following terms, 'act only on that maxim through which you can at the same time will that it should become a universal law.' (1948:84). Kant argues that this basic condition of universality in determining the moral principles for governing human relations is a necessary expression of the moral autonomy and fundamental equality of all rational individuals. The categorical imperative is self-imposed by morally autonomous and formally equal rational persons. It provides the basis for determining the scope and form of those laws which morally autonomous and equally rational individuals will institute in order to secure these very same conditions. For Kant, the capacity for the exercise of reason is the distinguishing characteristic of humanity and the basis for justifying human dignity. As the distinguishing characteristic of humanity, formulating the principles of the exercise of reason must necessarily satisfy a test of universality; they must be capable of being universally recognized by all equally rational agents. Hence, Kant's formulation of the categorical imperative. Kant’s moral philosophy is notoriously abstract and resists easy comprehension. Though often overlooked in accounts of the historical development of human rights, his contribution to human rights has been profound. Kant provides a formulation of fundamental moral principles that, though exceedingly formal and abstract, are based upon the twin ideals of equality and moral autonomy. Human rights are rights we give to ourselves, so to speak, as autonomous and formally equal beings. For Kant, any such rights originate in the formal properties of human reason, and not the will of some super-human being.

The philosophical ideas defended by the likes of Locke and Kant have come to be associated with the general Enlightenment project initiated during the 17th. and 18th. Centuries, the effects of which were to extend across the globe and over ensuing centuries. Ideals such as natural rights, moral autonomy, human dignity and equality provided a normative bedrock for attempts at re-constituting political systems, for overthrowing formerly despotic regimes and seeking to replace them with forms of political authority capable of protecting and promoting these new emancipatory ideals. These ideals effected significant, even revolutionary, political upheavals throughout the 18th. Century, enshrined in such documents as the United States' Declaration of Independence and the French National Assembly’s Declaration of the Rights of Man and Citizen. Similarly, the concept of individual rights continued to resound throughout the 19th. Century exemplified by Mary Wollstencraft's Vindication of the Rights of Women and other political movements to extend political suffrage to sections of society who had been denied the possession of political and civil rights. The concept of rights had become a vehicle for effecting political change. Though one could argue that the conceptual prerequisites for the defence of human rights had long been in place, a full Declaration of the doctrine of human rights only finally occurred during the 20th. Century and only in response to the most atrocious violations of human rights, exemplified by the Holocaust. The Universal Declaration of Human Rights (UDHR) was adopted by the UN General Assembly on 10th. December 1948 and was explicitly motivated to prevent the future occurrence of any similar atrocities. The Declaration itself goes far beyond any mere attempt to reassert all individuals' possession of the right to life as a fundamental and inalienable human right. The UDHR consists of a Preamble and 30 articles which separately identify such things as the right not to be tortured (article 5), a right to asylum (article 14), a right to own property (article 17), and a right to an adequate standard of living (article 25) as being fundamental human rights. As I noted earlier, the UDHR has been further supplemented by such documents as the European Convention for the Protection of Human Rights and Fundamental Freedoms (1953) and the International Covenant on Economic, Social and Cultural Rights (1966). The specific aspirations contained within these three documents have themselves been reinforced by innumerable other Declarations and Conventions. Taken together these various Declarations, conventions and covenants comprise the contemporary human rights doctrine and embody both the belief in the existence of a universally valid moral order and a belief in all human beings' possession of fundamental and equal moral status, enshrined within the concept of human rights. It is important to note, however, that the contemporary doctrine of human rights, whilst deeply indebted to the concept of natural rights, is not a mere expression of that concept but actually goes beyond it in some highly significant respects. James Nickel ( 1987: 8-10) identifies three specific ways in which the contemporary concept of human rights differs from, and goes beyond that of natural rights. First, he argues that contemporary human rights are far more concerned to view the realization of equality as requiring positive action by the state, via the provision of welfare assistance, for example. Advocates of natural rights, he argues, were far more inclined to view equality in formalistic terms, as principally requiring the state to refrain from 'interfering' in individuals’ lives. Second, he argues that, whereas advocates of natural rights tended to conceive of human beings as mere individuals, veritable 'islands unto themselves', advocates of contemporary human rights are far more willing to recognize the importance of family and community in individuals' lives. Third, Nickel views contemporary human rights as being far more 'internationalist' in scope and orientation than was typically found within arguments in support of natural rights. That is to say, the protection and promotion of human rights are increasingly seen as requiring international action and concern. The distinction drawn by Nickel between contemporary human rights and natural rights allows one to discern the development of the concept of human rights. Indeed, many writers on human rights agree in the identification of three generations of human rights. First generation rights consist primarily of rights to security, property, and political participation. These are most typically associated with the French and US Declarations. Second generation rights are construed as socio-economic rights, rights to welfare, education, and leisure, for example. These rights largely originate within the UDHR. The final and third generation of rights are associated with such rights as a right to national self-determination, a clean environment, and the rights of indigenous minorities. This generation of rights really only takes hold during the last two decades of the 20th. Century but represents a significant development within the doctrine of human rights generally.

While the full significance of human rights may only be finally dawning on some people, the concept itself has a history spanning over two thousand years. The development of the concept of human rights is punctuated by the emergence and assimilation of various philosophical and moral ideals and appears to culminate, at least to our eyes, in the establishment of a highly complex set of legal and political documents and institutions, whose express purpose is the protection and promotion of the fundamental rights of all human beings everywhere. Few should underestimate the importance of this particular current of human history.

3. Philosophical analysis of the concept of human rights

Human rights are rights that attach to human beings and function as moral guarantees in support of our claims towards the enjoyment of a minimally good life. In conceptual terms, human rights are themselves derivative of the concept of a right. This section focuses upon the philosophical analysis of the concept of a 'right' in order to clearly demonstrate the various constituent parts of the concept from which human rights emerges. In order to gain a full understanding of both the philosophical foundations of the doctrine of human rights and the different ways in which separate human rights function, a detailed analysis is required.

a. Moral vs. Legal Rights

The distinction drawn between moral rights and legal rights as two separate categories of rights is of fundamental importance to understanding the basis and potential application of human rights. Legal rights refer to all those rights found within existing legal codes. A legal right is a right that enjoys the recognition and protection of the law. Questions as to its existence can be resolved by simply locating the relevant legal instrument or piece of legislation. A legal right cannot be said to exist prior to its passing into law and the limits of its validity are set by the jurisdiction of the body which passed the relevant legislation. An example of a legal right would be my daughter's legal right to receive an adequate education, as enshrined within the United Kingdom's Education Act (1944). Suffice it to say, that the exercise of this right is limited to the United Kingdom. My daughter has no legal right to receive an adequate education from a school board in Southern California. Legal positivists argue that the only rights that can be said to legitimately exist are legal rights, rights that originate within a legal system. On this view, moral rights are not rights in the strict sense, but are better thought of as moral claims, which may or may not eventually be assimilated within national or international law. For a legal positivist, such as the 19th. Century legal philosopher Jeremy Bentham, there can be no such thing as human rights existing prior to, or independently from legal codification. For a positivist determining the existence of rights is no more complicated than locating the relevant legal statute or precedent. In stark contrast, moral rights are rights that, it is claimed, exist prior to and independently from their legal counterparts. The existence and validity of a moral right is not deemed to be dependent upon the actions of jurists and legislators. Many people argued, for example, that the black majority in apartheid South Africa possessed a moral right to full political participation in that country's political system, even though there existed no such legal right. What is interesting is that many people framed their opposition to apartheid in rights terms. What many found so morally repugnant about apartheid South Africa was precisely its denial of numerous fundamental moral rights, including the rights not to be discriminated against on grounds of colour and rights to political participation, to the majority of that country's inhabitants. This particular line of opposition and protest could only be pursued because of a belief in the existence and validity of moral rights. A belief that fundamental rights which may or may not have received legal recognition elsewhere, remained utterly valid and morally compelling even, and perhaps especially, in those countries whose legal systems had not recognized these rights. A rights-based opposition to apartheid South Africa could not have been initiated and maintained by appeal to legal rights, for obvious reasons. No one could legitimately argue that the legal political rights of non-white South Africans were being violated under apartheid, since no such legal rights existed. The systematic denial of such rights did, however, constitute a gross violation of those peoples' fundamental moral rights.

From the above example it should be clear that human rights cannot be reduced to, or exclusively identified with legal rights. The legal positivist's account of justified law excludes the possibility of condemning such systems as apartheid from a rights perspective. It might, therefore, appear tempting to draw the conclusion that human rights are best identified as moral rights. After all, the existence of the UDHR and various International Covenants, to which South Africa was not a signatory in most cases, provided opponents of apartheid with a powerful moral argument. Apartheid was founded upon the denial of fundamental human rights. Human rights certainly share an essential quality of moral rights, namely, that their valid existence is not deemed to be conditional upon their being legally recognized. Human rights are meant to apply to all human beings everywhere, regardless of whether they have received legal recognition by all countries everywhere. Clearly, there remain numerous countries that wholly or partially exclude formal legal recognition to fundamental human rights. Supporters of human rights in these countries insist that the rights remain valid regardless, as fundamental moral rights. The universality of human rights positively entails such claims. The universality of human rights as moral rights clearly lends greater moral force to human rights. However, for their part, legal rights are not subject to disputes as to their existence and validity in quite the way moral rights are. It would be a mistake to exclusively identify human rights with moral rights. Human rights are better thought of as both moral rights and legal rights. Human rights originate as moral rights and their legitimacy is necessarily dependent upon the legitimacy of the concept of moral rights. A principal aim of advocates of human rights is for these rights to receive universal legal recognition. This was, after all, a fundamental goal of the opponents of apartheid. Human rights are best thought of, therefore, as being both moral and legal rights. The legitimacy claims of human rights are tied to their status as moral rights. The practical efficacy of human rights is, however, largely dependent upon their developing into legal rights. In those cases where specific human rights do not enjoy legal recognition, such as in the example of apartheid above, moral rights must be prioritised with the intention that defending the moral claims of such rights as a necessary prerequisite for the eventual legal recognition of the rights in question.

b. Claim Rights & Liberty Rights

To gain an understanding of the functional properties of human rights it is necessary to consider the more specific distinction drawn between claim rights and liberty rights. It should be noted that it is something of a convention to begin such discussions by reference to W.N. Hohfeld's (1919) more extended classification of rights. Hohfeld identified four categories of rights: liberty rights, claim rights, power rights, and immunity rights. However, numerous scholars have subsequently tended to collapse the last two within the first two and hence to restrict attention to liberty rights and claim rights. The political philosopher Peter Jones (1994) provides one such example.

Jones restricts his focus to the distinction between claim rights and liberty rights. He conforms to a well-established trend in rights' analysis in viewing the former as being of primary importance. Jones defines a claim right as consisting of being owed a duty. A claim right is a right one holds against another person or persons who owe a corresponding duty to the right holder. To return to the example of my daughter. Her right to receive an adequate education is a claim right held against the local education authority, which has a corresponding duty to provide her with the object of the right. Jones identifies further necessary distinctions within the concept of a claim right when he distinguishes between a positive claim right and a negative claim right. The former are rights one holds to some specific good or service, which some other has a duty to provide. My daughter's claim right to education is therefore a positive claim right. Negative claim rights, in contrast, are rights one holds against others' interfering in or trespassing upon one's life or property in some way. My daughter could be said to possess a negative claim right against others attempting to steal her mobile phone, for example. Indeed, such examples lead on to the final distinction Jones identifies within the concept of claim rights: rights held 'in personam' and rights held ‘in rem’. Rights held in personam are rights one holds against some specifically identified duty holder, such as the education authority. In contrast, rights held in rem are rights held against no one in particular, but apply to everyone. Thus, my daughter's right to an education would be practically useless were it not held against some identifiable, relevant, and competent body. Equally, her right against her mobile phone being stolen from her would be highly limited if it did not apply to all those capable of potentially performing such an act. Claim rights, then, can be of either a positive or a negative character and they can be held either in personam or in rem.

Jones defines liberty rights as rights which exist in the absence of any duties not to perform some desired activity and thus consist of those actions one is not prohibited from performing. In contrast to claim rights, liberty rights are primarily negative in character. For example, I may be said to possess a liberty right to spend my vacations lying on a particularly beautiful beach in Greece. Unfortunately, no one has a duty to positively provide for this particular exercise of my liberty right. There is no authority or body, equivalent to an education authority, for example, who has a responsibility to realize my dream for me. A liberty right can be said, then, to be a right to do as one pleases precisely because one is not under an obligation, grounded in others' claim rights, to refrain from so acting. Liberty rights provide for the capacity to be free, without actually providing the specific means by which one may pursue the objects of one's will. For example, a multi-millionaire and a penniless vagrant both possess an equal liberty right to holiday in the Caribbean each year.

c. Substantive categories of human rights

The above section was concerned to analyse what might be termed the 'formal properties' of rights. This section, in contrast, proceeds to consider the different categories of substantive human rights. If one delves into all of the various documents that together form the codified body of human rights, one can identify and distinguish between five different categories of substantive human rights. These are as follows: rights to life; rights to freedom; rights to political participation; rights to the protection of the rule of law; rights to fundamental social, economic, and cultural goods. These rights span the so-called three generations of rights and involve a complex combination of both liberty and claim rights. Some rights, such as for example the right to life, consist of both liberty and claim rights in roughly equal measure. Thus, the adequate protection of the right to life requires the existence of liberty rights against others trespassing against one's person and the existence of claim rights to have access to basic prerequisites to sustaining one's life, such as an adequate diet and health-care. Other rights, such as social, economic, and cultural rights, for example, are weighted more heavily towards the existence of various claim rights, which requires the positive provision of the objects of such rights. The making of substantive distinctions between human rights can have controversial, but important, consequences. Human rights are typically understood to be of equal value, each right is conceived of as equally important as every other. On this view, there can exist no potential for conflict between fundamental human rights. One is simply meant to attach equal moral weight to each and every human right. This prohibits arranging human rights in order of importance. However, conflict between rights can and does occur. Treating all human rights as of equal importance prohibits any attempts to address or resolve such conflict when it arises. Take the example of a hypothetical developing world country with severely limited financial and material resources. This country is incapable of providing the resources for realising all of the human rights for all of its citizens, though it is committed to doing so. In the meantime, government officials wish to know which human rights are more absolute than others, which fundamental human rights should it immediately prioritise and seek to provide for? This question, of course, cannot be answered if one sticks to the position that all rights are of equal importance. It can only be addressed if one allows for the possibility that some human rights are more fundamental than others and that the morally correct action for the government to take would be to prioritise these rights. A refusal to do so, no matter how consistent it may be philosophically would be tantamount to dogmatically sticking one's head in the metaphorical sands. Attempting to make such distinctions is, of course, a philosophically fraught exercise. It clearly requires the existence of some more ultimate criteria against which one can 'measure' the relative importance of separate human rights. This is a highly controversial issue within the philosophy of human rights and one which I shall return to when I consider how philosophers attempt to justify the doctrine of human rights. What remains to be addressed in our analysis of the concept of a human right are the questions of what adequately implementing human rights generally requires, and upon whom does this task fall; who has responsibility for protecting and promoting human rights and what is required of them to do so?

d. Scope of human rights duties

Human rights are said to be possessed equally, by everyone. A conventional corollary of this claim is that everyone has a duty to protect and promote the human rights of everyone else. However, in practice, the onus for securing human rights typically falls upon national governments and international, inter-governmental bodies. Philosophers such as Thomas Pogge (1995) argue that the moral burden for securing human rights should fall disproportionately upon such institutions precisely because they are best placed and most able to effectively perform the task. On this reading, non-governmental organizations and private citizens have an important role to play in supporting the global protection of human rights, but the onus must fall upon the relevant national and international institutions, such as the governments of nation-states and such bodies as the United Nations and the World Bank. One might wish to argue that, for example, human rights can be adequately secured by the existence of reciprocal duties held between individuals across the globe. However, 'privatizing' human rights in this fashion would ignore two particularly salient factors: individuals have a tendency to prioritise the moral demands of those closest to them, particularly members of their own family or immediate community; individuals' ability to exercise their duties is, to a large extent, determined by their own personal financial circumstances. Thus, global inequalities in the distribution of wealth fundamentally undermine the ability of those in the poorer countries to reciprocate assistance provided them by those living in wealthier countries. Reasons such as these underlie Pogge's insistence that the onus of responsibility lies at the level of national and international institutions. Adequately protecting and promoting human rights requires both nation-states ensuring the adequate provision of services and institutions for their own citizens and the co-operation of nation-states within international institutions acting to secure the requisite global conditions for the protection and promotion of everyone's human rights.

What must such bodies actively do to adequately secure individuals' human rights? Does my daughter’s human right to receive an adequate education require the education authority to do everything possible to assist and enhance my child's education? Does it require the provision of a world-class library, frequent study trips abroad, and employing the most able and best-qualified teachers? The answer is, of course, no. Given the relative scarcity of resources and the demands placed upon those resources, we are inclined to say that adequately securing individuals' human rights extends to the establishment of decent social and governmental practice so as to ensure that all individuals have the opportunity of leading a minimally good life. In the first instance, national governments are typically held to be primarily responsible for the adequate provision of their own citizens' human rights. Philosophers such as Brian Orend (2002) endorse this aspiration when he writes that the object of human rights is to secure 'minimal levels of decent and respectful treatment.' It is important to note, however, that the duty ensure the provision of even minimal levels of decent and respectful treatment cannot be strictly limited by national boundaries. The adequate protection and promotion of everyone's human rights does require, for example, the more affluent and powerful nation-states providing sufficient assistance to those countries currently incapable of adequately ensuring the protection of their own citizens' basic human rights. While some may consider Orend's aspirations for human rights to be unduly cautious, even the briefest survey of the extent of human suffering and deprivation in many parts of the world today is sufficient to demonstrate just how far we are from realizing even this fairly minimal standard.

National and international institutions bear the primary responsibility of securing human rights and the test for successfully fulfilling this responsibility is the creation of opportunities for all individuals to lead a minimally good life. The realization of human rights requires establishing the conditions for all human beings to lead minimally good lives and thus should not be confused as an attempt to create a morally perfect society. The impression that many have of human rights as being unduly utopian testifies less to the inherent demands of human rights and more to the extent to which even fairly modest aspirations are so far from being realized in the world today. The actual aspirations of human rights are, on the face of it, quite modest. However, this should not distract from a full appreciation of the possible force of human rights. Human rights call for the creation of politically democratic societies in which all citizens have the means of leading a minimally good life. While the object of individual human rights may be modest, the force of that right is intended to be near absolute. That is to say, the demands of rights are meant to take precedence over other possible social goals. Ronald Dworkin has coined the term 'rights as trumps' to describe this property. He writes that, 'rights are best understood as trumps over some background justification for political decisions that states a goal for the community as a whole.' (1977:153) In general, Dworkin argues, considerations of rights claims must take priority over alternative considerations when formulating public policy and distributing public benefits. Thus, for example, a minority's possession of rights against discriminatory treatment should trump any and all considerations of the possible benefits that the majority would derive from discriminating against the minority group. Similarly, an individual's right to an adequate diet should trump other individuals’ desires to eat lavish meals, despite the aggregate gain in pleasure these individuals would derive. For Dworkin, rights as trumps expresses the fundamental ideal of equality upon which the contemporary doctrine of human rights rests. Treating rights as trumps is a means for ensuring that all individuals are treated in an equal and like fashion in respect of the provision of fundamental human rights. Fully realizing the aspirations of human rights may not require the provision of 'state of the art' resources, but this should not detract from the force of human rights as taking priority over alternative social and political considerations.

4. Philosophical justifications of human rights

We have established that human rights originate as moral rights but that the successful passage of many human rights into international and national law enables one to think of human rights as, in many cases, both moral rights and legal rights. Furthermore, human rights may be either claim rights or liberty rights, and have a negative or a positive complexion in respect of the obligations imposed by others in securing the right. Human rights may be divided into five different categories and the principal object of securing human rights is the creation of the conditions for all individuals to have the opportunity to lead a minimally good life. Finally, human rights are widely considered to trump other social and political considerations in the allocation of public resources. Broadly speaking, philosophers generally agree on such issues as the formal properties of human rights, the object of human rights, and the force of human rights. However, there is much less agreement upon the fundamental question on how human rights may be philosophically justified. It would be fair to say that philosophers have provided many different, at times even conflicting, answers to this question. Philosophers have sought to justify human rights by appeal to single ideals such as equality, autonomy, human dignity, fundamental human interests, the capacity for rational agency, and even democracy. For the purposes of clarity and relative simplicity I will focus upon the two, presently most prominent, philosophical attempts to justify human rights: interests theory and will theory. Before I do that, it is necessary to address a prior question.

a. Do human rights require philosophical justification?

Many people tend to take the validity of human rights for granted. Certainly, for many non-philosophers human rights may all too obviously appear to rest upon self-evidently true and universally valid moral principles. In this respect, human rights may be perceived as empirical facts about the contemporary world. Human rights do exist and many people do act in accordance with the correlative duties and obligations respecting human rights entails. No supporter of human rights could possibly complain about such perceptions. If nothing else, the prevalence of such views is pragmatically valuable for the cause of human rights. However, moral philosophers do not enjoy such licence for epistemological complacency. Moral philosophers remain concerned by the question of the philosophical foundations of human rights. There is a good reason why we should all be concerned with such a question. What might be termed the 'philosophically naïve' view of human rights effectively construes human rights as legal rights. The validity of human rights is closely tied to, and dependent upon, the legal codification of human rights. However, as was argued earlier, such an approach is not sufficient to justify human rights. Arguments in support of the validity of any moral doctrine can never be settled by simply pointing to the empirical existence of particular moral beliefs or concepts. Morality is fundamentally concerned with what ought to be the case, and this cannot be settled by appeals to what is the case, or is perceived to be the case. From such a basis, it would have been very difficult to argue that apartheid South Africa, to take an earlier example, was a morally unjust regime. One must not confuse the law with morality, per se. Nor consider the two to be simply co-extensional. Human rights originate as moral rights. Human rights claim validity everywhere and for everyone, irrespective of whether they have received comprehensive legal recognition, and even irrespective of whether everyone is agreement with the claims and principles of human rights. Thus, one cannot settle the question of the philosophical validity of human rights by appealing to purely empirical observations upon the world. As a moral doctrine, human rights have to be demonstrated to be valid as norms and not facts. In order to achieve this, one has to turn to moral philosophy. Presently, two particular approaches to the question of the validity of human rights predominate: what might be loosely termed the 'interests theory approach' and the ‘will theory approach’.

b. The interests theory approach

Advocates of the interests theory approach argue that the principal function of human rights is to protect and promote certain essential human interests. Securing human beings' essential interests is the principal ground upon which human rights may be morally justified. The interests approach is thus primarily concerned to identify the social and biological prerequisites for human beings leading a minimally good life. The universality of human rights is grounded in what are considered to be some basic, indispensable, attributes for human well-being, which all of us are deemed necessarily to share. Take, for example, an interest each of us has in respect of our own personal security. This interest serves to ground our claim to the right. It may require the derivation of other rights as prerequisites to security, such as the satisfaction of basic nutritional needs and the need to be free from arbitrary detention or arrest, for example. The philosopher John Finnis provides a good representative of the interests theory approach. Finnis (1980) argues that human rights are justifiable on the grounds of their instrumental value for securing the necessary conditions of human well-being. He identifies seven fundamental interests, or what he terms 'basic forms of human good', as providing the basis for human rights. These are: life and its capacity for development; the acquisition of knowledge, as an end in itself; play, as the capacity for recreation; aesthetic expression; sociability and friendship; practical reasonableness, the capacity for intelligent and reasonable thought processes; and finally, religion, or the capacity for spiritual experience. According to Finnis, these are the essential prerequisites for human well-being and, as such, serve to justify our claims to the corresponding rights, whether they be of the claim right or liberty right variety.

Other philosophers who have defended human rights from an interests-based approach have addressed the question of how an appeal to interests can provide a justification for respecting and, when necessary, even positively acting to promote the interests of others. Such questions have a long heritage in western moral and political philosophy and extend at least as far back as the 17th. Century philosopher Thomas Hobbes. Typically, this approach attempts to provide what James Nickel (1987:84) has termed 'prudential reasons' in support of human rights. Taking as the starting point the claim that all human beings possess basic and fundamental interests, advocates of this approach argue that each individual owes a basic and general duty to respect the rights of every other individual. The basis for this duty is not mere benevolence or altruism, but individual self-interest. As Nickel writes, 'a prudential argument from fundamental interests attempts to show that it would be reasonable to accept and comply with human rights, in circumstances where most others are likely to do so, because these norms are part of the best means for protecting one's fundamental interests against actions and omissions that endanger them.' (ibid). Protecting one’s own fundamental interests requires others' willingness to recognize and respect these interests, which, in turn, requires reciprocal recognition and respect of the fundamental interests of others. The adequate protection of each individual's fundamental interests necessitates the establishment of a co-operative system, the fundamental aim of which is not to promote the common good, but the protection and promotion of individuals' self-interest.

For many philosophers the interests approach provides a philosophically powerful defence of the doctrine of human rights. It has the apparent advantage of appealing to human commonality, to those attributes we all share, and, in so doing, offers a relatively broad-based defence of the plethora of human rights considered by many to be fundamental and inalienable. The interests approach also provides for the possibility of resolving some of the potential disputes which can arise over the need to prioritise some human rights over others. One may do this, for example, by hierarchically ordering the corresponding interests identified as the specific object, or content, of each right.

However, the interests approach is subject to some significant criticisms. Foremost amongst these is the necessary appeal interests' theorists make to some account of human nature. The interests-approach is clearly operating with, at the very least, an implicit account of human nature. Appeals to human nature have, of course, proven to be highly controversial and typically resist achieving the degree of consensus required for establishing the legitimacy of any moral doctrine founded upon an account of human nature. For example, combining the appeal to fundamental interests with the aspiration of securing the conditions for each individual leading a minimally good life would be complicated by social and cultural diversity. Clearly, as the economic philosopher Amartya Sen (1999) has argued, the minimal conditions for a decent life are socially and culturally relative. Providing the conditions for leading a minimally good life for the residents of Greenwich Village would be significantly different to securing the same conditions for the residents of a shanty town in Southern Africa or South America. While the interests themselves may be ultimately identical, adequately protecting these interests will have to go beyond the mere specification of some purportedly general prerequisites for satisfying individuals' fundamental interests. Other criticisms of the interests approach have focused upon the appeal to self-interest as providing a coherent basis for fully respecting the rights of all human beings. This approach is based upon the assumption that individuals occupy a condition of relatively equal vulnerability to one another. However, this is simply not the case. The model cannot adequately defend the claim that a self-interested agent must respect the interests of, for example, much less powerful or geographically distant individuals, if she wishes to secure her own interests. On these terms, why should a purely self-interested and over-weight individual in, say, Los Angeles or London, care for the interests of a starving individual in some distant and impoverished continent? In this instance, the starving person is not in a position to affect their overweight counterpart's fundamental interests. The appeal to pure self-interest ultimately cannot provide a basis for securing the universal moral community at the heart of the doctrine of human rights. It cannot justify the claims of universal human rights. An even more philosophically oriented vein of criticism focuses upon the interests' based approach alleged neglect of constructive human agency as a fundamental component of morality generally. Put simply, the interests-based approach tends to construe our fundamental interests as pre-determinants of human moral agency. This can have the effect of subordinating the importance of the exercise of freedom as a principal moral ideal. One might seek to include freedom as a basic human interest, but freedom is not constitutive of our interests on this account. This particular concern lies at the heart of the so-called 'will approach' to human rights.

c. The Will Theory Approach

In contrast to the interests approach, the will theory attempts to establish the philosophical validity of human rights upon a single human attribute: the capacity for freedom. Will theorists argue that what is distinctive about human agency is the capacity for freedom and that this ought to constitute the core of any account of rights. Ultimately, then, will theorists view human rights as originating in, or reducible to, a single, constitutive right, or alternatively, a highly limited set of purportedly fundamental attributes. H.L.A. Hart, for example, inferentially argues that all rights are reducible to a single, fundamental right. He refers to this as 'equal right of all men to be free.' (1955:77). Hart insists that rights to such things as political participation or to an adequate diet, for example, are ultimately reducible to, and derivative of, individuals' equal right to liberty. Henry Shue (1996) develops upon Hart's inferential argument and argues that liberty alone is not ultimately sufficient for grounding all of the rights posited by Hart. Shue argues that many of these rights imply more than mere individual liberty and extend to include security from violence and the necessary material conditions for personal survival. Thus, he grounds rights upon liberty, security, and subsistence. The moral philosopher Alan Gewirth (1978, 1982) has further developed upon such themes. Gewirth argues that the justification of our claims to the possession of basic human rights is grounded in what he presents as the distinguishing characteristic of human beings generally: the capacity for rationally purposive agency. Gewirth states that the recognition of the validity of human rights is a logical corollary of recognizing oneself as a rationally purposive agent since the possession of rights are the necessary means for rationally purposive action. Gewirth grounds his argument in the claim that all human action is rationally purposive. Every human action is done for some reason, irrespective of whether it be a good or a bad reason. He argues that in rationally endorsing some end, say the desire to write a book, one must logically endorse the means to that end; as a bare minimum one's own literacy. He then asks what is required to be a rationally purposive agent in the first place? He answers that freedom and well-being are the two necessary conditions for rationally purposive action. Freedom and well-being are the necessary means to acting in a rationally purposive fashion. They are essential prerequisites for being human, where to be human is to possess the capacity for rationally purposive action. As essential prerequisites, each individual is entitled to have access to them. However, Gewirth argues that each individual cannot simply will their own enjoyment of these prerequisites for rational agency without due concern for others. He bases the necessary concern for others' human rights upon what he terms the 'principle of generic consistency' (PGC). Gewirth argues that each individual’s claim to the basic means for rationally purposive action is based upon an appeal to a general, rather than, specific attribute of all relevant agents. I cannot logically will my own claims to basic human rights without simultaneously accepting the equal claims of all rationally purposive agents to the same basic attributes. Gewirth has argued that there exists an absolute right to life possessed separately and equally by all of us. In so claiming, Gewirth echoes Dworkin's concept of rights as trumps, but ultimately goes further than Dworkin is prepared to do by arguing that the right to life is absolute and cannot, therefore, be overridden under any circumstances. He states that a 'right is absolute when it cannot be overridden in any circumstances, so that it can never be justifiably infringed and it must be fulfilled without any exceptions.' (1982:92). Will theorists then attempt to establish the validity of human rights upon the ideal of personal autonomy: rights are a manifestation of the exercise of personal autonomy. In so doing, the validity of human rights is necessarily tied to the validity of personal autonomy. On the face of it, this would appear to be a very powerful, philosophical position. After all, as someone like Gewirth might argue, critics of this position would themselves necessarily be acting autonomously and they cannot do this without simultaneously requiring the existence of the very means for such action: even in criticizing human rights one is logically pre-supposing the existence of such rights.

Despite the apparent logical force of the will approach, it has been subjected to various forms of criticism. A particularly important form of criticism focuses upon the implications of will theory for so-called 'marginal cases'; human beings who are temporarily or permanently incapable of acting in a rationally autonomous fashion. This would include individuals who have diagnosed from suffering from dementia, schizophrenia, clinical depression, and, also, individuals who remain in a comatose condition, from which they may never recover. If the constitutive condition for the possession of human rights is said to be the capacity for acting in a rationally purposive manner, for example, then it seems to logically follow, that individuals incapable of satisfying this criteria have no legitimate claim to human rights. Many would find this conclusion morally disturbing. However, a strict adherence to the will approach is entailed by it. Some human beings are temporarily or permanently lacking the criteria Gewirth, for instance, cites as the basis for our claims to human rights. It is difficult to see how they could be assimilated within the community of the bearers of human rights on the terms of Gewirth's argument. Despite this, the general tendency is towards extending human rights considerations towards many of the so-called 'marginal cases'. To do otherwise would appear to many to be intuitively wrong, if not ultimately defensible by appeal to practical reason. This may reveal the extent to which many peoples' support of human rights includes an ineluctable element of sympathy, taking the form of a general emotional concern for others. Thus, strictly applying the will theorists' criteria for membership of the community of human rights bearers would appear to result in the exclusion of some categories of human beings who are presently recognized as legitimate bearers of human rights.

The interests theory approach and the will theory approach contain strengths and weaknesses. When consistently and separately applied to the doctrine of human rights, each approach appears to yield conclusions that may limit or undermine the full force of those rights. It may be that philosophical supporters of human rights need to begin to consider the potential philosophical benefits attainable through combining various themes and elements found within these (and other) philosophical approaches to justifying human rights. Thus, further attempts at justifying the basis and content of human rights may benefit from pursuing a more thematically pluralist approach than has typically been the case to date.

5. Philosophical criticisms of human rights

The doctrine of human rights has been subjected to various forms of fundamental, philosophical criticism. These challenges to the philosophical validity of human rights as a moral doctrine differ from critical appraisals of the various philosophical theories supportive of the doctrine for the simple reason that they aim to demonstrate what they perceive to the philosophical fallacies upon which human rights are founded. Two such forms of critical analysis bear particular attention: one which challenges the universalist claims of human rights, and another which challenges the presumed objective character of human rights principles.

a. Moral relativism

Philosophical supporters of human rights are necessarily committed to a form of moral universalism. As moral principles and as a moral doctrine, human rights are considered to be universally valid. However, moral universalism has long been subject to criticism by so-called moral relativists. Moral relativists argue that universally valid moral truths do not exist. For moral relativists, there is simply no such thing as a universally valid moral doctrine. Relativists view morality as a social and historical phenomenon. Moral beliefs and principles are therefore thought of as socially and historically contingent, valid only for those cultures and societies in which they originate and within which they are widely approved. Relativists point to the vast array of diverse moral beliefs and practices apparent in the world today as empirical support for their position. Even within a single, contemporary society, such as the United States or Great Britain, one can find a wide diversity of fundamental moral beliefs, principles, and practices. Contemporary, complex societies are thus increasingly considered to be pluralist and multicultural in character. For many philosophers the multicultural character of such societies serves to fundamentally restrict the substance and scope of the regulative political principles governing those societies. In respect of human rights, relativists have tended to focus upon such issues as the presumed individualist character of the doctrine of human rights. It has been argued by numerous relativists that human rights are unduly biased towards morally individualist societies and cultures, at the necessary expense of the communal moral complexion of many Asian and African societies. At best, some human rights' articles may be considered to be redundant within such societies, at worse they may appear to be positively harmful if fully implemented, replacing the fundamental values of one civilization with those of another and thereby perpetuating a form of cultural and moral imperialism.

The philosophical debate between universalists and relativists is far too complex to adequately summarise here. However, certain immediate responses to the relativist critique of human rights are immediately available. First, merely pointing to moral diversity and the presumed integrity of individual cultures and societies does not, by itself, provide a philosophical justification for relativism, nor a sufficient critique of universalism. After all, there have existed and continue to exist many cultures and societies whose treatment of their own people leaves much to be desired. Is the relativist genuinely asking us to recognize and respect the integrity of Nazi Germany, or any other similarly repressive regime? There can be little doubt that, as it stands, relativism is incompatible with human rights. On the face of it, this would appear to lend argumentative weight to the universalist support of human rights. After all, one may speculate as to the willingness of any relativist to actually forego their possession of human rights if and when the social surroundings demanded it. Similarly, relativist arguments are typically presented by members of the political elites within those countries whose systematic oppression of their peoples has attracted the attention of advocates of human rights. The exponential growth of grass-roots human rights organizations across many countries in the world whose cultures are alleged to be incompatible with the implementation of human rights, raises serious questions as to the validity and integrity of such 'indigenous' relativists. At its worst, the doctrine of moral relativism may be being deployed in an attempt to illegitimately justify oppressive political systems. The concern over the presumed incompatibility between human rights and communal moral systems appears to be a more valid issue. Human rights have undeniably conceived of the principal bearer of human rights as the individual person. This is due, in large part, to the Western origins of human rights. However, it would be equally fair to say that the so-called 'third generation' of human rights is far more attuned to the communal and collective basis of many individuals' lives. In keeping with the work of political philosophers such as Will Kymlicka, there is increasing awareness of the need to tailor human rights principles to such things as the collective rights of minorities and, for example, these minorities' claims to such things as communal land rights. While human rights remain philosophically grounded within an individualist moral doctrine, there can be no doubt that attempts are being made to adequately apply and human rights to more communally oriented societies. Human rights can no longer be accused of being 'culture-blind'.

b. Epistemological criticisms of human rights

The second most important contemporary philosophical form of human rights' criticism challenges the presumed objective basis of human rights as moral rights. This form of criticism may be thought of as a river into which run many philosophical tributaries. The essence of these attempts to refute human rights consists in the claim that moral principles and concepts are inherently subjective in character. On this view moral beliefs do not emanate from a correct determination of a rationally purposive will, or even gaining insight into the will of some divine being. Rather, moral beliefs are fundamentally expressions of individuals' partial preferences. This position therefore rejects the principal ground upon which the concept of moral rights rests: that there exist rational and a priori moral principles upon which a correct and legitimate moral doctrine is to be founded. In modern, as opposed to ancient, philosophy this argument is most closely associated with the 18th. Century Scottish philosopher David Hume. More recently versions of it have been defended by the likes of C.L.Stevenson, Ludwig Wittgenstein, J.L.Mackie, and Richard Rorty. Indeed, Rorty (1993) has argued that human rights are based not upon the exercise of reason, but a sentimental vision of humanity. He insists that human rights are not rationally defensible. He argues that one cannot justify the basis of human rights by appeal to moral theory and the canons of reason since, he insists, moral beliefs and practices are not ultimately motivated by an appeal to reason or moral theory, but emanate from a sympathetic identification with others: morality originates in the heart, and not in the head. Interestingly, though unambiguously sceptical about the philosophical basis of human rights, Rorty views the existence of human rights as a 'good and desirable thing', something whose existence we all benefit from. His critique of human rights is this not motivated by an underlying hostility to the doctrine. For Rorty, human rights are better served by emotional appeals to identify with the unnecessary suffering of others, than by arguments over the correct determination of reason.

Rorty's emphasis upon the importance of an emotional identification with others is a legitimate concern. It may, for example, provide additional support for the philosophical arguments presented by the likes of Gewirth. However, as Michael Freeman has recently pointed out, 'Rorty's argument…confuses motivation and justification. Sympathy is an emotion. Whether the action we take on the basis of our emotions is justified depends on the reasons for the action. Rorty wishes to eliminate unprovable metaphysical theories from philosophy, but in his critique of human-rights theory he goes too far, and eliminates reasoning.' (2002:56) Rorty’s own account of the basis and scope of moral knowledge ultimately prohibits him from claiming that human rights is a morally desirable phenomenon, since he explicitly rules out the validity of appealing to the independently verifiable criteria required to uphold any such judgement. What we require from Rorty is an independent reason for accepting his conclusion. It is precisely this that he denies may be legitimately provided by moral philosophy.

Rorty aside, the general critique of moral objectivity has a long and very well-established heritage in modern moral philosophy. It would be false to claim that either the objectivists or the subjectivists have scored any ultimate 'knock-down' over their philosophical opponents. Human rights are founded upon the claim to moral objectivity, whether by appeal to interests or the will. Any critique of moral objectivism is bound, therefore, to have repercussions for the philosophical defence of human rights. As I noted above, philosophers such as Alan Gewirth and John Finnis, in their separate and different ways, have attempted to establish the rational and objective force of human rights. The reader interested in pursuing this particular theme further is therefore recommended to pursue a close philosophical analysis of either, or both, of these two philosophers.

6. Conclusion

Human rights have a long historical heritage. The principal philosophical foundation of human rights is a belief in the existence of a form of justice valid for all peoples, everywhere. In this form, the contemporary doctrine of human rights has come to occupy centre stage in geo-political affairs. The language of human rights is understood and utilized by many peoples in very diverse circumstances. Human rights have become indispensable to the contemporary understanding of how human beings should be treated, by one another and by national and international political bodies. Human rights are best thought of as potential moral guarantees for each human being to lead a minimally good life. The extent to which this aspiration has not been realized represents a gross failure by the contemporary world to institute a morally compelling order based upon human rights. The philosophical basis of human rights has been subjected to consistent criticism. While some aspects of the ensuing debate between philosophical supporters and opponents of human rights remain unresolved and, perhaps, irresolvable, the general case for human rights remains a morally powerful one. Arguably, the most compelling motivation for the existence of human may rest upon the exercise of imagination. Try imagining a world without human rights!

7. References and Further Reading

  • Dworkin, Ronald. Taking Rights Seriously, (London: Duckworth, 1978)
  • Freeman, Michael. Human Rights: An Interdisciplinary Approach, (Cambridge: Polity, 2002)
  • Finnis, John. Natural Law and Natural Rights, (Oxford; Clarendon Press, 1980)
  • Gewirth, Alan. Reason and Morality, (Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1978)
  • Gewirth, Alan. Human Rights: Essays on Justification and Applications, (Chicago; University of Chicago Press, 1982)
  • Jones, Peter. Rights, (Basingstoke; Macmillan, 1994)
  • Mackie, J.L. Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong, (Harmondsworth; Penguin, 1977)
  • Nickel, James. Making Sense of Human Rights: Philosophical Reflections on the Universal Declaration of Human Rights, (Berkeley; University of California Press, 1987)
  • Rorty, Richard. "Human rights, rationality, and sentimentality". In S.Shute & S. Hurley (eds.) On Human Rights: the Oxford Amnesty Lectures 1993, (New York; Basic Books, 1993)
  • Waldron, Jeremy. Theories of Rights, (Oxford; Oxford University Press, 1984) Chapters by Ronald Dworkin, Alan Gewirth, and H.L.A.Hart

Author Information

Andrew Fagan
University of Essex
United Kingdom

Hegel: Social and Political Thought

hegelGeorg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel (1770-1831) is one of the greatest systematic thinkers in the history of Western philosophy. In addition to epitomizing German idealist philosophy, Hegel boldly claimed that his own system of philosophy represented an historical culmination of all previous philosophical thought. Hegel's overall encyclopedic system is divided into the science of Logic, the philosophy of Nature, and the philosophy of Spirit. Of most enduring interest are his views on history, society, and the state, which fall within the realm of Objective Spirit. Some have considered Hegel to be a nationalistic apologist for the Prussian State of the early 19th century, but his significance has been much broader, and there is no doubt that Hegel himself considered his work to be an expression of the self-consciousness of the World Spirit of his time. At the core of Hegel's social and political thought are the concepts of freedom, reason, self-consciousness, and recognition. There are important connections between the metaphysical or speculative articulation of these ideas and their application to social and political reality, and one could say that the full meaning of these ideas can be grasped only with a comprehension of their social and historical embodiment. The work that explicates this concretizing of ideas, and which has perhaps stimulated as much controversy as interest, is the Philosophy of Right (Philosophie des Rechts), which will be a main focus of this essay.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Political Writings
  3. The Jena Writings (1802-06)
  4. The Phenomenology of Spirit
  5. Logic and Political Theory
  6. The Philosophy of Right
    1. Abstract Right
    2. Morality
    3. Ethical Life
      1. The Family
      2. Civil Society
      3. The State
        1. Constitutional Law
        2. International Law
        3. World History
  7. Closing Remarks
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Hegel in German and in English Translation
    2. Works on Hegel's Social and Political Philosophy

1. Biography

G.W.F. Hegel was born in Stuttgart in 1770, the son of an official in the government of the Duke of Württemberg. He was educated at the Royal Highschool in Stuttgart from 1777-88 and steeped in both the classics and the literature of the European Enlightenment. In October, 1788 Hegel began studies at a theological seminary in Tübingen, the Tüberger Stift, where he became friends with the poet Hölderlin and philosopher Friedrich Schelling, both of whom would later become famous. In 1790 Hegel received an M.A. degree, one year after the fall of the Bastille in France, an event welcomed by these young idealistic students. Shortly after graduation, Hegel took a post as tutor to a wealthy Swiss family in Berne from 1793-96. In 1797, with the help of his friend Hölderlin, Hegel moved to Frankfurt to take on another tutorship. During this time he wrote unpublished essays on religion which display a certain radical tendency of thought in his critique of orthodox religion.

In January 1801, two years after the death of his father, Hegel finished with tutoring and went to Jena where he took a position as Privatdozent (unsalaried lecturer) at the University of Jena, where Hegel's friend Schelling had already held a university professorship for three years. There Hegel collaborated with Schelling on a Critical Journal of Philosophy (Kritisches Journal der Philosophie) and he also published a piece on the differences between the philosophies of Fichte and Schelling (Differenz des Fichte'schen und Schelling'schen Systems der Philosophie) in which preference was consistently expressed for the latter thinker. After having attained a professorship in 1805, Hegel published his first major work, the Phenomenology of Spirit (Phänomenologie des Geistes, 1807) which was delivered to the publisher just at the time of the occupation of Jena by Napoleon's armies. With the closing of the University, due to the victory of the French in Prussia, Hegel had to seek employment elsewhere and so he took a job as editor of a newspaper in Bamberg, Bavaria in 1807 (Die Bamberger Zeitung) followed by a move to Nuremberg in 1808 where Hegel became headmaster of a preparatory school (Gymnasium), roughly equivalent to a high school, and also taught philosophy to the students there until 1816. During this time Hegel married, had children, and published his Science of Logic (Wissenschaft der Logik) in three volumes.

One year following the defeat of Napoleon at Waterloo (1815), Hegel took the position of Professor of Philosophy at the University of Heidelberg where he published his first edition of the Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences in Outline (Encyklopädie der philosophischen Wissenschaften im Grundrisse, 1817). In 1818 he became Professor of Philosophy at the University of Berlin, through the invitation of the Prussion minister von Altenstein (who had introduced many liberal reforms in Prussia until the fall of Napoleon), and Hegel taught there until he died in 1831. Hegel lectured on various topics in philosophy, most notably on history, art, religion, and the history of philosophy and he became quite famous and influential. He held public positions as a member of the Royal Examination Commission of the Province of Brandenberg and also as a councellor in the Ministry of Education. In 1821 he published the Philosophy of Right (Philosophie des Rechts) and in 1830 was given the honor of being elected Rector of the University. On November 14, 1831 Hegel died of cholera in Berlin, four months after having been decorated by Friedrich Wilhelm III of Prussia.

2. Political Writings

Apart from his philosophical works on history, society, and the state, Hegel wrote several political tracts most of which were not published in his lifetime but which are significant enough in connection to the theoretical writings to deserve some mention. (These are published in English translation in Hegel's Political Writings and Political Writings, listed in the bibliography of works by Hegel below.)

Hegel's very first political work was on "On the Recent Domestic Affairs of Wurtemberg" (Über die neuesten innern Verhältnisse Württembergs…, 1798) which was neither completed nor published. In it Hegel expresses the view that the constitutional structure of Wurtemberg requires fundamental reform. He condemns the absolutist rule of Duke Ferdinand along with the narrow traditionalism and legal positivism of his officials and welcomes the convening of the Estates Assembly, while disagreeing with the method of election in the Diet. In contrast to the existing system of oligarchic privilege, Hegel argues that the Diet needs to be based on popular election through local town councils, although this should not be done by granting suffrage to an uneducated multitude. The essay ends inconclusively on the appropriate method of political representation.

A quite long piece of about 100 pages, The German Constitution (Die Verfassung Deutchlands) was written and revised by Hegel between 1799 and 1802 and was not published until after his death in 1893. This piece provides an analysis and critique of the constitution of the German Empire with the main theme being that the Empire is a thing of the past and that appeals for a unified German state are anachronistic. Hegel finds a certain hypocrisy in German thinking about the Empire and a gap between theory and practice in the German constitution. Germany was no longer a state governed by law but rather a plurality of independent political entities with disparate practices. Hegel stresses the need to recognize that the realities of the modern state necessitate a strong public authority along with a populace that is free and unregimented. The principle of government in the modern world is constitutional monarchy, the potentialities of which can be seen in Austria and Prussia. Hegel ends the essay on an uncertain note with the idea that Germany as a whole could be saved only by some Machiavellian genius.

The essay "Proceedings of the Estates Assembly in the Kingdom of Württemberg, 1815-1816" was published in 1817 in the Heidelbergische Jahrbücher. In it Hegel commented on sections of the official report of the Diet of Württemberg, focusing on the opposition by the Estates to the King's request for ratification of a new constitutional charter that recognized recent liberalizing changes and reforms. Hegel sided with King Frederick and criticized the Estates as being reactionary in their appeal to old customary laws and feudal property rights. There has been controversy over w