Category Archives: Political Philosophy

Kwasi Wiredu (1931— )

Kwasi Wiredu is a philosopher from Ghana, who has for decades been involved with a project he terms “conceptual decolonization” in contemporary African systems of thought.  By conceptual decolonization, Wiredu advocates a re-examination of current African epistemic formations in order to accomplish two aims.  First, he wishes to subvert unsavory aspects of tribal culture embedded in modern African thought so as to make that thought more viable.  Second, he intends to dislodge unnecessary Western epistemologies that are to be found in African philosophical practices.

In previously colonized regions of the world, decolonization remains a topical issue both at the highest theoretical levels and also at the basic level of everyday existence. After African countries attained political liberation, decolonization became an immediate and overwhelming preoccupation.  A broad spectrum of academic disciplines took up the conceptual challenges of decolonization in a variety of ways.  The disciplines of anthropology, history, political science, literature, and philosophy all grappled with the practical and academic conundrums of decolonization.

A central purpose in this article is to examine the contributions and limitations of African philosophy in relation to the history of the debate on decolonization.  In this light, it sometimes appears that African philosophy has been quite limited in defining the horizons of the debate when compared with the achievements of academic specialties such as literature and cultural studies. Thus, decolonization has been rightly conceived as a vast, global, and trans-disciplinary enterprise.

This analysis involves an examination of both the limitations and immense possibilities of Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization.  First, the article offers a close reading of the theory itself and then locates it within the broader movement of modern African thought.  In several instances, Wiredu’s theory has proved seminal to the advancement of contemporary African philosophical practices.  It is also necessary to be aware of current imperatives of globalization, nationality, and territoriality and how they affect the agency of a theory such as ideological/conceptual decolonization.  Indeed, the notion of decolonization is far more complex than is often assumed.  Consequently, the epistemological resources by which it can be apprehended as a concept, ideology, or process are multiple and diverse.  Lastly, this article, as a whole, represents a reflection on the diversity of the dimensions of decolonization.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Early Beginnings
  3. Decolonization as Epistemological Practice
  4. Tradition, Modernity and the Challenges of Development
  5. An African Reading of Karl Marx
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Kwasi Wiredu is one of Africa’s foremost philosophers, and he has done a great deal to establish the discipline of philosophy, in its contemporary shape, as a credible area of intellection in most parts of the African continent and beyond.  In order to appreciate the conceptual and historical contexts of his work, it is necessary to possess some familiarity with relevant discourses in African studies and history, anthropology, literature and postcolonial theory, particularly those advanced by Edward W. Said, Gayatri Spivak, Homi Bhabha, Abiola Irele and Biodun Jeyifo.  Wiredu’s contribution to the making of modern African thought provides an interesting insight into the processes involved in the formation of postcolonial disciplines and discourses, and it can also be conceived as a counter-articulation to the hegemonic discourses of imperial domination.

 Wiredu, for many decades, was involved with a project he termed conceptual decolonization in contemporary African systems of thought. This term entailed, for Wiredu, a re-examination of current African epistemic foundations in order to accomplish two main objectives.  First, he intended to undermine counter-productive facets of tribal cultures embedded in modern African, thought so as to make this body of thought both more sustainable and more rational.  Second, he intended to deconstruct the unnecessary Western epistemologies which may be found in African philosophical practices.

A broad spectrum of academic disciplines took up the conceptual challenges of decolonization in a variety of ways. In particular, the disciplines of anthropology, history, political science, literature and philosophy all grappled with the practical and academic challenges inherent to decolonization.

It is usually profitable to examine the contributions and limitations of African philosophers comparatively (along with other African thinkers who are not professional philosophers) in relation to the history of the debate on decolonization.  In addition to the scholars noted above, the discourse of decolonialization has benefitted from many valuable contributions made by intellectuals such as Frantz Fanon, Leopold Sedar Senghor, Cheikh Anta Diop, and Ngugi wa Thiongo.  In this light, it would appear that African philosophy has been, at certain moments, limited in defining the horizons of the debate when compared with the achievements of academic specialties such as literature, postcolonial theory and cultural studies. Thus, decolonization, as Ngugi wa Thiongo, the Kenyan cultural theorist and novelist, notes, must be conceived as a broad, transcontinental, and multidisciplinary venture.

Within the Anglophone contingent of African philosophy, the analytic tradition of British philosophy continues to be dominant.  This discursive hegemony had led an evident degree of parochialism.  This in turn has led to the neglect of many other important intellectual traditions.  For instance, within this Anglophonic sphere, there is not always a systematic interrogation of the limits, excesses and uses of colonialist anthropology in formulating the problematic of identity.  In this regard, the problematic of identity does not only refer to the question of personal agency but more broadly, the challenges of discursive identity.  This shortcoming is not as evident in Francophone traditions of African philosophy, which usually highlight the foundational discursive interactions between anthropology and modern African thought.  Thus, in this instance, there is an opening to other discursive formations necessary for the nurturing a vibrant philosophical practice.  Also, within Anglophone African philosophy, a stringent critique of imperialism and contemporary globalization does not always figure is not always significantly in the substance of the discourse, thereby further underlining the drawbacks of parochialism.  As such, it is necessary for critiques of Wiredu’s corpus to move beyond its ostensible frame to include critiques and discussions of traditions of philosophical practice outside the Anglophone divide of modern African thought (Osha, 2005).  Accordingly, such critiques ought not merely be a celebration of post-structuralist discourses to the detriment of African intellectual traditions.  Instead, they should be, among other things, an exploration of the discursive intimacies between the Anglophone and Francophone traditions of African philosophy.  In addition, an interrogation of other borders of philosophy is required to observe the gains that might accrue to the Anglophone movement of contemporary African philosophy, which, in many ways, has reached a discursive dead-end due to its inability to surmount the intractable problematic of identity, and its endless preoccupation with the question of its origins. These are the sort of interrogations that readings of Wiredu’s work necessitate. Furthermore, a study of Wiredu’s corpus (Osha, 2005) identifies—if only obliquely—the necessity to re-assess the importance of other discourses such as colonialist anthropology and various philosophies of black subjectivity in the formation of the modern African subject.  These are some of the central concerns which appear in Kwasi Wiredu and Beyond: The Text, Writing and Thought in Africa (2005).

2. Early Beginnings

Kwasi Wiredu was born in 1931 in Ghana and had his first exposure to philosophy quite early in life.  He read his first couple of books of philosophy in school around 1947 in Kumasi, the capital of Ashanti.  These books were Bernard Bosanquet’s The Essentials of Logic and C.E.M. Joad’s Teach Yourself Philosophy.  Logic, as a branch of philosophy attracted Wiredu because of its affinities to grammar, which he enjoyed.  He was also fond of practical psychology during the formative years of his life.  In 1950, whilst vacationing with his aunt in Accra, the capital of Ghana, he came across another philosophical text which influenced him tremendously.  The text was The Last Days of Socrates which had the following four dialogues by Plato: The Apology, Euthyphro, Meno and Crito. These dialogues were to influence, in a significant way, the final chapter of his first groundbreaking philosophical text, Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) which is also dialogic in structure.

He was admitted into the University of Ghana, Legon in 1952, to read philosophy, but before attending he started to study the thought of John Dewey on his own. However, mention must be made of the fact that C. E. M. Joad’s philosophy had a particularly powerful effect on him. Indeed, he employed the name J. E. Joad as his pen-name for a series of political articles he wrote for a national newspaper, The Ashanti Sentinel between 1950 and1951.  At the University of Ghana, he was instructed mainly in Western philosophy and he came to find out about African traditions of thought more or less through his own individual efforts.  He was later to admit that the character of his undergraduate education was to leave his mind a virtual tabula rasa, as far as African philosophy was concerned.  In other words, he had to develop and maintain his interests in African philosophy on his own. One of the first texts of African philosophy that he read was J. B. Danquah’s Akan Doctrine of God: A Fragment of Gold Coast Ethics and Religion.  Undoubtedly, his best friend William Abraham, who went a year before him to Oxford University, must have also influenced the direction of his philosophical research towards African thought.  A passage from an interview explains the issue of his institutional relation to African philosophy:

Prior to 1985, when I was in Africa, I devoted most of my time in almost equal proportions to research in African philosophy and in other areas of philosophy, such as the philosophy of logic, in which not much has, or is generally known to have, been done in African philosophy.  I did not have always to be teaching African philosophy or giving public lectures in African philosophy. There were others who were also competent to teach the subject and give talks in our Department of Philosophy.  But since I came to the United States, I have often been called upon to teach or talk about African philosophy.  I have therefore spent much more time than before researching in that area. This does not mean that I have altogether ignored my earlier interests, for indeed, I continue to teach subjects like (Western) logic and epistemology (Wiredu in Oladiop 2002: 332).

Wiredu began publishing relatively late, but has been exceedingly prolific ever since he started. During the early to mid 1970s, he often published as many as six major papers per year on topics ranging from logic, to epistemology, to African systems of thought, in reputable international journals.  His first major book, Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) is truly remarkable for its eclectic range of interests.  Paulin Hountondji, Wiredu’s great contemporary from the Republic of Benin, for many years had to deal with charges that his philosophically impressive corpus lacked ideological content and therefore merit from critics such as Olabiyi Yai (1977).  Hountondji (1983; 2002) in those times of extreme ideologizing, never avoided the required measure of socialist posturing.  Wiredu, on the other hand, not only avoided the lure of socialism but went on to denounce it as an unfit ideology.  Within the context of the socio-political moment of that era, it seemed a reactionary—even injurious—posture to adopt.  Nonetheless, he had not only laid the foundations of his project of conceptual decolonization at the theoretical level but had also begun to explore its various practical implications by his analyses of concepts such as “truth,” and also by his focused critique of some of the more counter-productive impacts of both colonialism and traditional culture.

By conceptual decolonization, Wiredu advocates a re-examination of current African epistemic formations in order to accomplish two objectives.  First, he wishes to subvert unsavoury aspects of indigenous traditions embedded in modern African thought so as to make it more viable.  Second, he intends to undermine the unhelpful Western epistemologies to be found in African philosophical traditions. On this important formulation of his he states:

By this I mean the purging of African philosophical thinking of all uncritical assimilation of Western ways of thinking. That, of course, would be only part of the battle won. The other desiderata are the careful study of our own traditional philosophies and the synthesising of any insights obtained from that source with any other insights that might be gained from the intellectual resources of the modern world.  In my opinion, it is only by such a reflective integration of the traditional and the modern that contemporary African philosophers can contribute to the flourishing of our peoples and, ultimately, all other peoples. (Oladipo, 2002: 328)

In spite of his invaluable contributions to modern African thought, it can be argued that Wiredu’s schema falls short as a feasible long term epistemic project.  Due to the hybridity of the postcolonial condition, projects seeking to retrieve the precolonial heritage are bound to be marred at several levels.  It would be an error for Wiredu or advocates of his project of conceptual decolonization to attempt to universalize his theory since, as Ngugi wa Thiongo argues, decolonization is a vast, global enterprise.  Rather, it is safer to read Wiredu’s project as a way of articulating theoretical presence for the de-agentialized and deterritorialized contemporary African subject.  In many ways, his project resembles those of Ngugi wa Thiongo and Cheikh Anta Diop.  Ngugi wa Thiongo advocates cultural and linguistic decolonization on a global scale and his theory has undergone very little transformation since its formulation in the 1960s.  Diop advances a similar set of ideas to Wiredu on the subject of vibrant modern African identities. Wiredu’s project is linked in conceptual terms to the broader project of political decolonization as advanced by liberationist African leaders such as Julius Nyerere, Jomo Kenyatta, Kwame Nkrumah, and Nnamdi Azikiwe.  But what distinguishes the particular complexion of his theory is its links with the Anglo-Saxon analytic tradition. This dimension is important in differentiating his project from those of his equally illustrious contemporaries such as V. Y. Mudimbe and Paulin Hountondji.  In fact, it can be argued that Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization has more similarities with Ngugi wa Thiongo’s ideas regarding African cultural and linguistic agency than Mudimbe’s archeological excavations of African traces in Western historical and anthropological texts.

3. Decolonization as Epistemological Practice

In all previously colonized regions of the world, decolonization remains a topic of considerable academic interest.  Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization is essentially what defines his attitudes and gestures towards the content of contemporary African thought.  Also it is an insight that is inflected by years of immersion into British analytic philosophy.  Wiredu began his reflections of the nature, legitimate aims, and possible orientations in contemporary African thought not as a result of any particular awareness of the trauma or violence of colonialism or imperialism but by a confrontation with the dilemma of modernity by the reflective (post)colonial African consciousness.  This dialectic origin can be contrasted with those of his contemporaries such as Paulin Hountondji and V. Y. Mudimbe.

Despite criticisms regarding some aspects of his work, in terms of founding a tradition for the practice of modern African philosophy, Wiredu’s contributions have been pivotal. He has also been very consistent in his output and the quality of his reflections regardless of some of their more obvious limitations.

As noted earlier, Wiredu was trained in a particular tradition of Western philosophy: the analytic tradition.  This fact is reflected in his corpus.  A major charge held against him is that his contributions could be made even richer if he had grappled with other relevant discourses: postcolonial theory, African feminisms, contemporary Afrocentric discourses and the global dimensions of projects and discourses of decolonization.

Kwasi Wiredu’s interests and philosophical importance are certainly not limited to conceptual decolonization alone.  He has offered some useful insights on Marxism, mysticism, metaphysics, and the general nature of the philosophical enterprise itself. Although his latter text, Cultural Universals and Particulars has a more Africa-centred orientation, his first book, Philosophy and an African Culture presents a wider range of discursive interests: a vigorous critique of Marxism, reflections on the phenomenon of ideology, analyses of truth and the philosophy of language, among other preoccupations. It is interesting to see how Wiredu weaves together these different preoccupations and also to observe how some of them have endured while others have not.

The volume Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy is an apt summation of Wiredu’s philosophical interests with a decidedly African problematic while his landmark philosophical work, Philosophy and an African Culture, published first in 1980, should serve as a fertile source for more detailed elucidation.

In the second essay of Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy entitled “The Need for Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy”, Wiredu writes that “with an even greater sense of urgency the intervening decade does not seem to have brought any indications of a widespread realization of the need for conceptual decolonisation in African philosophy” (Wiredu, 1995: 23).  The intention at this juncture is to examine some of the ways in which Wiredu has been involved in the daunting task of conceptual decolonization.  Decolonization itself is a problematic exercise because it necessitates the jettisoning of certain conceptual attitudes that inform one’s worldviews.  Secondly, it usually entails an attempt at the retrieval of a more or less fragmented historical heritage.  Decolonization in Fanon’s conception entails this necessity for all colonized peoples and, in addition, it is “a programme of complete disorder” (Fanon, 1963:20).  This understanding is purely political and has therefore, a practical import.  This is not to say that Fanon had no plan for the project of decolonization in the intellectual sphere.  Also associated with this project as it was then conceived was a struggle for the mental liberation of the colonized African peoples.  It was indeed a program of violence in more senses than one.

However, with Wiredu, there isn’t an outright endorsement of violence, as decolonization in this instance amounts to conceptual subversion.  As a logical consequence, it is necessary to stress the difference between Fanon’s conception of decolonization and Wiredu’s.  Fanon is sometimes regarded as belonging to the same philosophical persuasion that harbours figures like Nkrumah, Senghor, Nyerere and Sekou Toure, “the philosopher-kings of early post-independence Africa” (Wiredu,1995:14), as Wiredu calls them.  This is so because they had to live out the various dramas of existence and the struggles for self and collective identity at more or less the same colonial/postcolonial moment.  Those “spiritual uncles” of professional African philosophers were engaged, as Wiredu states, in a strictly political struggle, and whatever philosophical insight they possessed was put at the disposal of this struggle, instead of a merely theoretical endeavour.  Obviously, Fanon was the most astute theoretician of decolonization of the lot.  In addition, for Fanon and the so-called philosopher-kings, decolonization was invested with a pan-African mandate and political appeal.  This crucial difference should be noted alongside what shall soon be demonstrated to be the Wiredu conception of decolonization.  Africans, generally, will have to continue to ponder the entire issue of decolonization as long as unsolved questions of identity remain and the challenges of collective development linger.  This type of challenge was foreseen by Fanon.

The end of colonialism in Africa and other Third World countries did not entail the end of imperialism and the dominance of the metropolitan countries.  Instead, the dynamics of dominance assumed a more complex, if subtle, form.  African economic systems floundered alongside African political institutions, and, as a result, various crises have compounded the seemingly perennial issue of underdevelopment.

A significant portion of post-colonial theory involves the entry of Third World scholars into the Western archive, as it were, with the intention of dislodging the erroneous epistemological assumptions and structures regarding their peoples.  This, arguably, is another variant of decolonization.  Wiredu partakes of this type of activity, but sometimes he carries the program even further.  Accordingly, he affirms:

Until Africa can have a lingua franca, we will have to communicate suitable parts of our work in our multifarious vernaculars, and in other forms of popular discourse, while using the metropolitan languages for international communication. (Wiredu, 1995:20)

This conviction has been a guiding principle with Wiredu for several years.  In fact, it is not merely a conviction; there are several instances within the broad spectrum of his philosophical corpus where he tries to put it into practice.  Two of such attempts are his essays “The Concept of Truth in the Akan Language” and “The Akan Concept of Mind.”  In the first of these articles, Wiredu states “there is no one word in Akan for truth” (Wiredu, 1985:46).  Similarly, he writes, “another linguistic contrast between Akan and English is that there is no word “fact” (Ibid.).  It is necessary to cite the central thesis of the essay; Wiredu writes that he wants “to make a metadoctrinal point which reflection on the African language enables us to see, which is that a theory of truth is not of any real universal significance unless it offers some account of the notion of being so” (Ibid.).

Wiredu’s argument here, needs to be firmer.  In many respects, he is only comparing component parts of the English language with the Akan language and not always with a view to drawing out “any real universal significance” as he says.  The entire approach seems to be irrevocably restrictive.  This is the distinction that lies between an oral culture and a textual one.  Most African intellectuals usually gloss over this difference, even though they may acknowledge it.  The difference is indeed very significant, because of the numerous imponderables that come into play.  Abiola Irele has been able to demonstrate the tremendous significance of orality in the constitution of modern African forms of literary expression.

However, Wiredu is more convincing in his essay “Democracy and Consensus in African Traditional Politics: A Plea for a Non-Party Polity”.  In this essay, Wiredu argues that the:

Ashanti system was a consensual democracy. It was a democracy because government was by the consent, and subject to the control, of the people as expressed through the representatives. It was consensual because, at least, as a rule, that consent was negotiated on the principle of consensus. (By contrast, the majoritarian system might be said to be, in principle, based on consent without consensus.) (Ibid. pp58-59)

When Wiredu broaches the issue of politics and its present and future contexts in postcolonial Africa, then we are compelled to visit a whole range of debates and discourses especially in the social sciences in Africa.  These arearguably more directly concerned with questions pertaining to governance, democracy, and the challenges of contemporary globalization.

Another essay by Wiredu, entitled “The Akan Concept of Mind” is also an attempt of conceptual recontextualization.  Wiredu begins by stating that he is restricting himself to a study of the Akans of Ghana in order “to keep the discussion within reasonable anthropological bounds” (Wiredu, 1983:113).  His objective is a modest but nevertheless important one, since it fits quite well with his entire philosophical project which, as noted, is concerned with ironing out philosophical issues “on independent grounds” and possibly in one’s own language and the metropolitan language bequeathed by the colonial heritage.

It is therefore appropriate to proceed gradually, traversing the problematic interfaces between various languages in search of satisfactory structures of meaning.  The immediate effect is a radical diminishing of the entire concept of African philosophy, a term which under these circumstances would become even more problematic.  The consequence of Wiredu’s position is that to arrive at the essence of African philosophy, it would be necessary to dismantle its monolithic structure to make it more context-bound.  First, Africa as a spatial entity would require further re-drawing of its often problematic geography.  Second, a new thematics to mediate between the general and the particular would have to be found.  Third, the critique of unanimism and ethnophilosophy would be driven into more contested terrains.  These are some of the likely challenges posed by Wiredu’s approach.

Furthermore, in dealing with the traditional Akan conceptual system, or any other, for that matter, it should be borne in mind that what is in contention is “a folk philosophy, a body of originally unwritten ideas preserved in the oral traditions, customs and usages of a people” (Ibid.).

It would be appropriate to examine more closely his article “The Akan Concept of Mind”.  Here, Wiredu enumerates the ways in which the English conception of mind differs markedly from that of the Akan, due in a large part to certain fundamental linguistic dissimilarities.  He also makes the point that “the Akans most certainly do not regard mind as one of the entities that go to constitute a person” (Ibid. 121).  It is significant to note this, but at the same time, it is difficult to imagine the ultimate viability of this approach.  Indeed after reformulating traditional Western philosophical problems to suit African conditions, it remains to be seen how African epistemological claims can be substantiated using the natural and logical procedures available to African systems of thought.  As such, it is possible to argue that this conceptual manoeuvre would eventually degenerate into a dead-end of epistemic nativism.  These are the kinds of issues raised by Wiredu’s project.

As such, inherent in the thrust for complete decolonization is the presence of colonial violence itself.  In addition, there is essentially a latent desire for epistemic violence, as well as difficulties concerning the negotiation of linguistic divides. In the following quotation, for example, Wiredu attempts to demonstrate the significance of some of those differences:

By comparison with the conflation of concepts of mind and soul prevalent in Western philosophy, the Akan separation of the “Okra” from “adwene” suggests a more analytical awareness of the sanctification of human personality. (Ibid.128)

It is necessary to substantiate more rigorously claims such as this because we may also be committing an error in establishing certain troublesome linguistic or philosophical correspondences between two disparate cultures and traditions.

Another crucial, if distressing, feature of decolonization as advanced by Wiredu is that it always has to measure itself up with the colonizing Other, that is, it finds it almost impossible to create its own image so to speak by the employment of autochthonous strategies.  This is not to assert that decolonization always has to avail itself of indigenous procedures, but the very concept of decolonization is in fact concerned with breaking away from imperial structures of dominance in order to express a will to self-identity or presence.  To be sure, the Other is always present, defacing all claims to full presence of the decolonizing subject.  This is a contradictory but inevitable trope within the postcolonial condition.  The Other is always there to present the criteria by which self-identity is adjudged either favourably or unfavourably. There is no getting around the Other as it is introduced in its own latent and covert violence, in the hesitant counter-violence of the decolonizing subject and invariably in the counter-articulations of all projects of decolonization.

4. Tradition, Modernity and the Challenges of Development

Wiredu’s later attempts at conceptual decolonization have been quite interesting.  An example of such an attempt is the essay “Custom and Morality: A Comparative Analysis of some African and Western Conceptions of Morals.”  He is able to explore at greater length some of the conceptual confusions that arise as a result of the transplantation of Western ideas within an African frame of reference.  This wholesale transference of foreign ideas and conceptual models has caused the occurrence of severe cases of identity crises and, to borrow a more apposite term, colonial mentality.  Indeed, one of the aims of Wiredu’s efforts at conceptual decolonization is to indicate instances of colonial mentality and determine strategies by which they can be minimized.  Accordingly he is quite convincing when he argues that polygamy in a traditional setting amounts to efficient social thinking but is most inappropriate within a modern framework.  In this way, Wiredu is offering a critique of a certain traditional practice that ought to be discarded on account of the demands and realities of a modern economy.

On another level, it appears that Wiredu has not sufficiently interrogated the distance between orality and textuality.  If indeed he has done so, he would be rather more skeptical about the manner in which he thinks he can dislodge certain Western philosophical structures embedded in the African consciousness.

Wiredu has always believed that traditional modes of thought and folk philosophies should be interpreted, clarified, analyzed and subjected to critical evaluation and assimilation (Wiredu, 1980: x).  Also, at the beginning of his philosophical reflections, he puts forth the crucial formulation that there is no reason why the African philosopher “in his philosophical meditations […] should not test formulations in those against intuitions in his own language” (Wiredu, 1980: xi).  And, rather than merely discussing the possibilities for evolving modern traditions in African philosophy, African philosophers should actually begin to do so (Hountondji, 1983).  In carrying out this task, the African philosopher has a few available methodological approaches.  First, he is urged to “acquaint himself with the different philosophies of the different cultures of the world, not to be encylopaedic or eclectic, but with the aim of trying to see how far issues and concepts of universal relevance can be disentangled from the contingencies of culture” (Wiredu, 1980: 31).  He also adds that “the African philosopher has no choice but to conduct his philosophical inquiries in relation to the philosophical writings of other peoples, for his ancestors left him no heritage of philosophical writings” (Wiredu, 1980: 48).  For Wiredu, the use of translations is a fundamental aspect of contemporary African philosophical practices.  However, on the dilemmas of translation in the current age of neoliberalism, it has been noted: “translations are [..] put ‘out of joint.’  However correct or legitimate they may be, and whatever right one may acknowledge them to have, they are all disadjusted, as it were unjust in the gap that affects them.  This gap is within them, to be sure, because their meanings remain necessarily equivocal; next it is in the relation among them and thus their multiplicity, and finally or first of all in the irreducible inadequation to the other language and to the stroke of genius of the event that makes the law, to all the virtualities of the original” (Derrida, 1994:19).  Wiredu does not contemplate the implications of this kind of indictment in his formulations of an approach to African philosophy.  Perhaps the task at hand is simply too important and demanding to cater to such philosophical niceties.  In relation to the kind of philosophical heritage at the disposal of the African philosopher, Wiredu identifies three main strands; “a folk philosophy, a written traditional philosophy and a modern philosophy” (Wiredu, 1980:46).  Wiredu’s approach to questions of this sort is embedded in his general theoretical stance: “It is a function, indeed a duty, of philosophy in any society to examine the intellectual foundations of its culture.  For any such examination to be of any real use, it should take the form of reasoned criticism and, where possible, reconstruction. No other way to philosophical progress is known than through criticism and adaptation” (Wiredu, 1980: 20).

The drive to attain progress is not limited to philosophical discourse alone.  Entire communities and cultures usually aim to improve upon their institutions and practices in order to remain relevant.  Societies can lose the momentum of growth and “various habits of thought and practice can become anachronistic within the context of the development of a given society; but an entire society too can become anachronistic within the context of the whole world if the ways of life within it are predominantly anachronistic.  In the latter case, of course, there is no discarding society; what you do is to modernize it” (Wiredu, 1980:1).  The theme of modernization occurs frequently in Wiredu’s corpus.  He does not fully conceptualize it nor relate it to the various ideological histories it has encountered in the domains of social science, where it became a fully fledged discipline. Modernization, for him, is based on an uncomplicated pragmatism that owes much to Deweyan thought.

This kind of posture, that is, the consistent critique of the retrogression inherent in tradition and its proclivity for the fossilization of culture, is directed at Leopold Sedar Senghor.  On Senghor, he writes, “it is almost as if he has been trying to exemplify in his own thought and discourse the lack of the analytical habit which he has attributed to the biology of the African.  Most seriously of all, Senghor has celebrated the fact our (traditional) mind is of a non-analytical bent; which is very unfortunate, seeing that this mental attribute is more of a limitation than anything else” (Wiredu, 1980:12).  Wiredu’s main criticism of Senghor is one that is always leveled against the latter.  Apart from that charge that Senghor essentializes the concept and ideologies of blackness, he is also charged with defeatism that undermines struggles for liberation and decolonization.  However, Paul Gilroy has unearthed a more sympathetic context in which to read and situate Senghorian thought.  In Gilroy’s reading, an acceptable ideology of blackness emerges from Senghor’s work. And in this way, Wiredu’s critique loses some of its originality.

Senghor is cast as a traditionalist and tradition itself is the subject of a much broader critique.  On some of the drawbacks of tradition Wiredu writes,

it is as true in Africa as anywhere else that logical, mathematical, analytical, experimental procedures are essential in the quest for the knowledge of, and control over, nature and therefore, in any endeavour to improve the condition of man. Our traditional culture was somewhat wanting in this respect and this is largely responsible for the weaknesses of traditional technology, warfare, architecture, medicine….” (Wiredu, 1980: 12) (italics mine)

Sometimes, Wiredu carries his critique of tradition too far as when he advances the view that “traditional medicine is terribly weak in diagnosis and weaker still in pharmacology” (Wiredu, 1980: 12).  In recent times, a major part of Hountondji’s project is to demonstrate that traditional knowledges are not only useful and viable but also the necessity to situate them in appropriate modern contexts.  Hountondji’s latest gesture is curious since both he and Wiredu are supposed to belong to the same philosophic tendency as described by Bodunrin under the rubric of West-led universalism.  However, Wiredu’s attack on tradition is vitiated by his project of conceptual decolonization which, in order to work, requires the recuperation of vital elements in traditional culture.

Wiredu’s stance in relation to modernization and tradition gets refined by his condemnation of some aspects of urban existence which exhibit a manifestation of postmodern environmentalism. First, he writes, “it is quite clear to me that unrestricted industrial urbanization is contrary to any humane culture; it is certainly contrary to our own” (Wiredu, 1980:22). Also, “one of the powerful strains on our extended family system is the very extensive poverty which oppresses out rural populations. Owing to this, people working in the towns and cities are constantly burdened with the financial needs of rural relatives which they usually cannot entirely satisfy”(Wiredu, 1980:22). Contemporary anthropological studies dealing with Africa have dwelt extensively on this phenomenon. The point is, in Africa, forms of sociality exists that can no longer be found in the North Atlantic civilization. If this civilization (the North Atlantic) is characterized by extreme individualism, African forms of social existence on the other hand tend towards the gregarious in which conceptions of generosity, corruption, gratitude, philanthropy, ethnicity  and even justice take on different slightly forms from what obtains within the vastly different North Atlantic context.

Also problematic is Wiredu’s reading of colonialism which is very similar to those of authors such as Ngugi wa Thiongo, Walter Rodney or even Chinua Achebe. In this reading, the colonized is abused, brutalized, silenced and reconstructed against her/his own will.  Colonialism causes the destruction of agency. On de-agentialization, Wiredu states, “any human arrangement is authoritarian if it entails any person being made to do or suffer something against his will, or if it leads to any person being hindered in the development of his own will” (Wiredu, 1980:2).  Homi Bhabha advances the notion of ambivalence to highlight the cultural reciprocities inherent in the entire colonial encounter and structure. This kind of reading of the colonial event has led to a rethinking of colonial theory. But Wiredu’s reading of the colonial encounter is infected by the radical persuasion of early African theorists of decolonization: “The period of colonial struggle was […] a period of cultural affirmation. It was necessary to restore in ourselves our previous confidence which had been so seriously eroded by colonialism. We are still, admittedly, even in post-colonial times, in an era of cultural self-affirmation” (Ibid.59).

5. An African Reading of Karl Marx

Marxist theory and discourse generally provided many African intellectuals with a platform on which to conduct many sociopolitical struggles. In fact, for many African scholars, it served as the only ideological tool. But not all scholars found Marxism acceptable. Wiredu was one of the scholars who has deep reservations about it. But he is not in doubt about the philosophical significance of Marx: “I regard Karl Marx as one of the great philosophers” (Wiredu, 1980:63). Derrida is even more forthcoming on the depth of this significance: “It will always be a fault not to read and reread and discuss Marx- which is to say also a few others- and to go beyond scholarly “reading” or “discussion.” It will be more and more a fault, a failing of theoretical, philosophical, political responsibility” (Derrida, 1994:13). Again, he writes, “the Marxist inheritance was- and still remains, and so it will remain- absolutely and thoroughly determinate. One need not be a Marxist or a communist in order to accept this obvious fact. We all live in a world, some would say a culture, that bears, at an incalculable depth, the mark of this inheritance, whether in a directly visible fashion or not”(Ibid.).

Marxism during era of the Cold War was the major ideological issue and in the present age of neoliberalism it continues to haunt (Derrida’s precise phrase is hauntology) us with its multiple legacies. Wiredu’s critique of Marx and Engels is located within the epoch of the Cold War. But from it, we get a glimpse of not only his political orientation but also his philosophical predilections. For instance, at a point, he claims “the food one eats, the hairstyle one adopts, the amount of money one has, the power one wields- all these and such circumstances are irrelevant from an epistemological point of view” (Wiredu, 1980:66). But Foucault-style analyses have demonstrated that these seemingly marginal activities have a tremendous impact on knowledge/power configurations that are often difficult to ignore. Michel de Certeau has demonstrated these so-called inconsequential acts become significant as gestures of resistance for the benefit of the weak and politically powerless. In his words, “the weak must continually turn to their own ends forces alien to them” (de Certeau 1984: xix). On those specific acts of the weak, he writes, “many everyday practices (talking, reading, moving about, shopping, cooking, etc.) are tactical in character. And so are, more generally, many “ways of operating”: victories of the “weak” over the “strong” (whether the strength be that of powerful people or the violence of things or of an imposed order, etc.), clever tricks, knowing how to get away with things, “hunter’s cunning,” maneuvers, polymorphic simulations, joyful discoveries, poetic  as well as warlike. The Greeks called these “ways of operating” metis (Ibid.). This reading gives an entirely different perspective on acts and themes of resistance as panoptical surveillance in the age of global neoliberalism becomes more totalitarian in nature at specific moments.

As a philosopher versed in analytic philosophy, truth is a primary concern of Wiredu and this concern is incorporated into his analysis of Marxist philosophy. Hence, he identifies the following points, “the cognition of truth is recognized by Engels as the business of philosophy; (2) What is denied is absolute truth, not truth as such; (3) The belief, so finely expressed, in the progressive character of truth; (4) Engels speaks of this process of cognition as the ‘development of science.’ (5) That a consciousness of limitation is a necessary element in all acquired knowledge” (Wiredu,1980:64-65). Wiredu explains that these various Marxian assertions on truth are no different from those of the logician, C. S. Peirce who had expounded them under a formulation he called “fallibilism.” John Dewey also expounded them under the concept of ‘pragmatism’(Ibid.67). So the point here is that some of the main Marxist propositions on truth have parallels in analytic philosophy. Nonetheless, this raises an unsettling question about Marxism and its relation to truth: “How is it that a philosophy which advocates such an admirable doctrine as the humanistic conception of truth tends so often to lead in practice to the suppression of freedom of thought and expression? Is it by accident that this comes to be so? Or is it due to causes internal to the philosophy of Marx and Engels”(Ibid.68). Wiredu demonstrates strong reservations about what Ernest Wamba dia Wamba calls ‘bureaucratic socialism.” Derrida on his part, urges us to distinguish between Marx as a philosopher and the innumerable specters of Marx. In other words, there is a difference between “the dogma machine and the “Marxist” ideological apparatuses (States, parties, cells, unions, and other places of doctrinal production)”(Derrida,1994:13)  and the necessity to treat Marx as a great philosopher. We need to “try to play Marx off against Marxism so as to neutralize, or at any rate muffle the political imperative in the untroubled exegesis of classified work” (Ibid.31).  We also need to remember that “he doesn’t belong to the communists, to the Marxists, to the parties, he ought to figure within our great canon of […] political philosophy” (Ibid.31).

Wiredu’s reading of Marxism generally is quite damaging. First, he states, “Engels himself, never perfectly consistent, already compromises his conception of truth with some concessions to absolute truth in Anti-Duhring” (Wiredu, 1980:68). He then makes an even more damaging accusation that a form of authoritarianism lies at the heart of conception of philosophy propagated by Marx and Engels.  On what he considers to a deep-seated confusion in their work, he writes, “Engels recognizes the cognition of truth to be a legitimate business of philosophy and makes a number of excellent points about truth. As soon, however, as one tries to find out what he and Marx conceived philosophy to be like, one is faced with a deep obscurity. The problem resolves round what one may describe as Marx’s conception of philosophy as ideology” (Ibid.70). Here, Wiredu makes the crucial distinction between Marx as a philosopher and the effects of his numerous spectralities and for this reason he offers his most important criticism of his general critique of Marxism. He also accuses Marx of instances of “carelessness in the use of cardinal terms” which he says “may be symptomatic of deep inadequacies of thought”(Ibid.74). This charge, which relates to Marx’s conception of consciousness is indeed serious since it borders on the question of conceptual clarification as advanced by the canon of analytic philosophy. Wiredu argues that Marx and Engels are unclear about their employment of the concept of ideology: “Marx and Engels are […] on the horns of a dilemma. If all philosophical thinking is ideological, then their thinking is ideological and, by their hypothesis, false”(Ibid.76). Wiredu’s insights are very important here: “He and Engels simply assumed for themselves the privilege of exempting their own philosophizing from the ideological theory of ideas”(Ibid.77). Consequently, Marx commits a grave error “in his conception of ideology and its bearing upon philosophy”(Ibid.81).

Another area Wiredu finds Marx and Engels wanting is moral philosophy. In other words, Marx “confused moral philosophy with moralism and assumed rather than argued a moral standpoint”(Ibid.79). Furthermore, he had precious little to say on the nature of the relationship between philosophy and morality. Engels does better on this score as there is a treatment of morality in Anti-Duhring. Nonetheless, Engels is charged with giving “no guidance on the conceptual problems that have perplexed moral philosophers” (Ibi.80). Henceforth, Wiredu becomes increasing dismissive of Marx, Marxism and its followers. First, he writes, “the run-of the-mill Marxists, even less enamoured of philosophical accuracy than their masters, have made the ideological conception of philosophy a battle cry”(Ibid.80). And then he singles out ‘scientific socialism’ which he regards as being unclear in its elaboration and which he typifies as “an amalgam of factual and evaluative elements blended together without regard to categorical stratification”(Ibid.85). In one of his most damaging assessments of Marxism, he declares: “Ideology is the death of philosophy. To the extent to which Marxism, by its own internal incoherences, tends to be transformed into an ideology, to that extent Marxism is a science of the unscientific and a philosophy of the unphilosophic” (Ibid.87).

In sum, Wiredu general attitude towards Marxism is one of condemnation. However, in the contemporary re-evaluations of Marxism a few discursive elements need to be clarified; the inclusion of the demarcation of Cold War and post Cold War assessments of Marxism ought to be employed as an analytical yardstick and also the necessity to sift through the various specters and legacies of Marx as distinct from those of Marxism. This is the kind of reading that Derrida urges us to do and it is also one to which we shall now turn our attention.

Derrida states it is imperative to distinguish between the legacies of Marx and the various spectralities of Marxism. In addition to this distinction we might add another crucial one: analyses of Marxism before and after the fall of the former Soviet Union. Wiredu’s critique is based on the pre-Soviet debacle whilst Derrida’s draws some of his reflections based on the post-Soviet fall. In these two different critiques, we must be careful to always strive to isolate the theoretical elements and insights that bypass short-lived discursive trends and political interests which often tend to vitiate the more profound effects of the works of Karl Marx and those that do not.

The debacle of the former Soviet Union and the apparent hegemony of neoliberal ideology have generated discourses associated with the “ends” of discourse. But Derrida points out that there is nothing new in the contemporary proclamations affirming the end of discourses which are in fact anachronistic when compared to the earlier versions of the same discursive orientation that emerged in the 1950s and which in a vital sense owed a great deal to a certain spirit of Marx: “the eschatological themes of the “end of history,” of the “end of Marxism,” of the “end of philosophy,” of the “ends of man,” of the “last man” and so forth were, in the ‘50s, that is, forty years ago our daily bread. We had this bread of apocalypse in our mouths naturally, already, just as naturally as that which I nicknamed after the fact, in 1980, the “apocalyptic tone in philosophy” (Derrida, 1994:14-15). In a way, in fact the contemporary discourses of endism that draw from the spirit of neoliberal triumphalism, without acknowledging it, are greatly indebted to Marxism and the more constructive critiques of it. Deconstruction, in part, emerged from the necessity to critique the various forms of statist Stalinism, the numerous socio-economic failings of Soviet bureaucracy and the political repression in Hungary. In other words, it emerged partly from the need to organize critiques for degraded forms of socialism.

In speaking about the inheritance of Marx, Derrida also reflects on the injunction associated with it. The task of reflecting on this inheritance and the injunction to which it gives rise is demanding: … “one must filter, sift, criticize, one must sort out several different possibles that inhabit the same injunction. And inhabit it in a contradictory fashion around a secret. If the readability of a legacy were given, natural, transparent, univocal, if it did not call for and at the same time defy interpretation, we would never have anything to inherit from it” (Ibid.16). Derrida’s employment of terms and phrases such “inheritance,” “injunction,” and the “spectrality of the specter” in relation to the legacies of Marx has to do with the question of the genius of Marx: “Whether evil or not, a genius operates, it always resists and defies after the fashion of a spectral thing. The animated work becomes that thing, the Thing that, like an elusive specter, engineers [s’ingenie] a habitation without proper inhabiting, call it is a haunting, of both memory and translation” (Ibid.18).

A work of genius, a masterpiece in addition to giving rise to spectralities also generates legions of imitators and followers. Of the Marxists who came after Marx, Wiredu writes; “I find that Marxists are especially prone to confuse factual with ideological issues. Undoubtedly, the great majority of those who call themselves Marxists do not share the ideology of Marx”(Wiredu,1980:94). In order to transcend the violence and confusion of Marxists who misread Marx, we need “to play Marx off against Marxism so as to neutralize, or at any rate muffle the political imperative in the untroubled exegesis of a classified work”(Derrida,1994:31). The work of re-reading Marx, of re-establishing his philosophical value and importance is a task needs to be performed in universities, conferences, colloquia and also in less academic sites and fora.

Within the contemporary cultural moment, new configurations have arisen that were not present during Marx’s day. Indeed, “a set of transformations of all sorts (in particular, techno-scientific-economic-media) exceeds both the traditional givens of the Marxist discourse and those of the liberal discourse opposed to it”(Ibid.70). Also,

Electoral representativity or parliamentary life is not only distorted, as was always the case, by a great number of socio-economic mechanisms, but it is exercised with more and more difficulty in a public space profoundly upset by techno-tele-media apparatuses and by new rhythms of information and communication, by the devices and the speed of forces represented by the latter, but also and consequently by the new modes of appropriation they put to work, by the new structure of the event and of its spectrality that they produce.” (Ibid.79)

Here, the instructive point is that the new information technologies have radically transformed the possibilities of the event and the modes of its production, reception and also interpretation. But there is a far more radical change that has occurred and which signals a profound crisis of global capitalism and the neoliberal ideology that underpins it: “For what must be cried out, at a time when some have the audacity to neo-evangelize in the name of the ideal of liberal democracy that has finally realized itself  as the ideal of human history: never have violence, inequality, exclusion, famine, and thus economic oppression affected as many human beings in the history of the earth and of humanity”(Ibid.85). Also, “never have so many men, women, and children been subjugated, starved, or exterminated on the earth.” (Ibid.)

So Derrida identifies a few new factors that need to be included in the critique of Marxism in the contemporary moment namely the phenomenon of spectralization caused by techno-science and digitalization, the weakening of the practice of liberal democracy and also the crises and multiple contradictions inherent in global capitalism. It is necessary to include another element into the present configuration which is the rise of political Islam as an alternative ideology, its subsequent fervent politicization and its Western reconstruction into an ideology of terror.

Wiredu’s reading of Marx focuses on the conceptual infelicities in the latter’s theorizations of notions such as “ideology,” “consciousness,” and “truth.” Wiredu also criticizes Marx’s project of moral philosophy or in fact the lack of it. On the whole, his reading isn’t complementary. Indeed, it amounts to a dismissal of Marx in spite of the attempt to read him without the obfuscations of innumerable legacies.

6. Conclusion

Arguably, Wiredu’s particular contribution to the debate on the origins, status, problematic and future of contemporary African philosophy resides in his formulations regarding his theory of conceptual decolonization. His approach in formulating this theory of discursive agency and more specifically philosophical practice involves the incorporation of a form bi-culturalism. In other words, his approach entails analyses of the canon of Western philosophy and also the manifestations of tribal cultures as a way of attaining a conceptual synthesis. Indeed, this schema involves a forceful element of bi-culturalism as a matter of logical consequence as well as a high level of [multi] bi-lingual competence. As such, it not only an exercise in conceptual synthesis but it is also a project involving comparative linguistics.

In Anglophone parts of Africa, Wiredu’s experience and research in teaching African philosophy has had a tremendous significance. The positive aspect of this is that the study of African philosophical thought has in positive moments transcended the problematic of identity or what has been termed as the problematic of origins. The less complimentary dimension of this equation is that Wiredu’s discoveries have given rise to (most undoubtedly unwittingly) a somewhat hegemonic school of disciples that is fostering a delimiting academicism and which is contrary to his essential spirit of conceptual inventiveness. As such, it might become necessary not only to critique Wiredu’s corpus but perhaps also Wiredu’s school of disciples which rather than appreciate the originality of his formulations fall instead for the pitfalls of over-ideologization.

Undoubtedly, Wiredu discovered a challenging path in modern African thought in which he sometimes takes the meaning of the existence of African philosophy for granted. In addition, it has been observed that also lacking at some moments in his oeuvre is an attempt to de-totalize and hence particularize the components of what he regards of the foundations of African philosophy.  In other words, African philosophy finds its form, shape and also its conceptual moorings above the discursive platform provided by Western philosophy. In addition, the theoretical space made available for its articulation is derived from the same Western-donated pool of unanimism. Part of recent interrogations of Wiredu’s work includes a questioning of the legitimacy of that space as the only site on which to construct an entire philosophical practice for the alienated, hybrid African consciousness. Oftentimes the question is posed, what are the ways by which the space can be broadened?

Indeed, terms such as reflective integration and due reflection offer the critical spaces for the theoretical articulation of something whose existence has not yet been concretely conceived. So in Wiredu’s corpus we see the very familiar problematic involving the tradition/modernity dichotomy being played out. Finally, it can be argued that this tension is not quite resolved but fortunately it is also a tension that never jeopardizes his philosophical inventiveness. Rather, it seems to animate his reflections in unprecedented ways.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Cronon, D. E. 1955. Black Moses: The Story of Marcus Garvey and the Universal Negro Improvement Association, Wisconsin: University of Wisconsin Press.
  • Cummings, Robert. 1986. “Africa between the Ages” in African Studies Review, Vol. 29, No. 3, September.
  • Diop, Cheikh, Anta, 1974. The African Origin of Civilization: Myth or Reality? Trans. M. Cook, Westport, Conn.: Lawrence Hill.
  • Doortmont, Michel R. 2005 The Pen-Pictures of Modern Africans and African Celebrities by Charles Francis Hutchison,  Leiden and Boston: Brill.
  • Dubow, Saul. 2000 The African National Congress, Johannesburg: Jonathan Ball.
  • Derrida, Jacques. 1994. Specters of Marx: the state of the debt, the work of mourning, & the new international, trans. Peggy Kamuf, New York: Routledge.
  • Gates Jr., H. L. 1992. Loose Canons, New York: OxfordUniversity Press.
  • Fanon, Frantz. 1967 Black Skin, White Masks (trans. C. Van Markmann) New York: Grove Press.
  • Fanon, Frantz. 1963 The Wretched of the Earth, London: Penguin.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1974 The Order of Things: An Archaeology of the Human Sciences. New York: Pantheon.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1977 Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison. Trans A. M. Sheridan-Smith. London: Allen Lane.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1980 Language, Counter-Memory and Practice. Selected Essays and Interviews. Ed. Donald Bouchard, Ithaca, NY: CornellUniversity Press.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1982 The Archaeology of Knowledge. New York: Pantheon.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1991 “Governmentality” in G. Burchell, C. Gordon and P. Miller, eds, The Foucault Effect.Chicago: Chicago University Press.
  • Hountondji, Paulin. 1983 African Philosophy: Myth and Reality, London: Hutchinson and Co.
  • Hountondji, Paulin.  2002 The Struggle for Meaning: Reflections on Philosophy, Culture and Democracy in Africa, Athens: Ohio University Center for International Studies.
  • Masolo, D.A. 1994 African Philosophy in Search of Identity Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Mudimbe V.Y. 1988 The Invention of Africa Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Mudimbe V.Y. 1994. The Idea of Africa,Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Oladipo,  Olusegun. ed. 2002  The Third Way in African Philosophy:Essays in Honour of Kwasi WireduIbadan: Hope Publications Ltd.
  • Osha, Sanya, 2005 Kwasi Wiredu and Beyond: The Text, Writing and Thought in Africa, Dakar: Codesria.
  • Soyinka, Wole, 1976 Myth, Literature and the African World Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole,   1988 Art, Dialogue and Outrage Ibadan: New Horn Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole, 1996 The Open Sore of a Continent New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole.  1999 The Burden of Memory, The Muse of Forgiveness New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole. 2000 “Memory, Truth and Healing” in The Politics of Memory, Truth, Healing and Social Justice, eds. I. Amaduime and A. An-Na’im, London: Zed Books
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1972 HomecomingLondon, Ibadan, Lusaka: Heinemann.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1981 Writers in PoliticsNairobi: Heinemann.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1986 Decolonising the MindNairobi: E.A.E.P.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1993 Moving the CentreLondon: James Currey.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. Philosophy and an African CultureCambridge: CambridgeUniversity Press, 1980.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi.  1983 “The Akan Concept of Mind” in Ibadan Journal of Humanistic Studies, No. 3.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1985 “The Concept of Truth in Akan Language” in P.O. Bodunrin ed. Philosophy in Africa: Trends and Perspectives, Ile-Ife: University of Ife Press.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. and Gyekye, Kwame. 1992 Persons and Community. Washington, D.C.: The Council for Research in Values and Philosophy.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1993 “Canons of Conceptualisation” in The Monist: An International Journal of General Philosophical Inquiry Vol. 76, No. 4 October.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1995 Conceptual Decolonization in African PhilosophyIbadan: Hope Publications.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi.  1996 Cultural Universals and ParticularsBloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Yai, Olabiyi. 1977 “The Theory and Practice in African Philosophy: The Poverty of Speculative Philosophy,” Second Order: An African Journal of Philosophy, Vol.VI, No.2.


Author Information

Sanya Osha
Tshwane University of Technology
South Africa

Karl Popper: Political Philosophy

popperAmong philosophers, Karl Popper (1902-1994) is best known for his contributions to the philosophy of science and epistemology. Most of his published work addressed philosophical problems in the natural sciences, especially physics; and Popper himself acknowledged that his primary interest was nature and not politics. However, his political thought has arguably had as great an impact as has his philosophy of science. This is certainly the case outside of the academy.  Among the educated general public, Popper is best known for his critique of totalitarianism and his defense of freedom, individualism, democracy and an “open society.” His political thought resides squarely within the camp of Enlightenment rationalism and humanism. He was a dogged opponent of totalitarianism, nationalism, fascism, romanticism, collectivism, and other kinds of (in Popper’s view) reactionary and irrational ideas.

Popper’s rejection of these ideas was anchored in a critique of the philosophical beliefs that, he argued, underpinned them, especially a flawed understanding of the scientific method. This approach is what gives Popper’s political thought its particular philosophical interest and originality—and its controversy, given that he locates the roots of totalitarianism in the ideas of some of the West’s most esteemed philosophers, ancient as well as modern. His defense of a freed and democratic society stems in large measure from his views on the scientific method and how it should be applied to politics, history and social science.  Indeed, his most important political texts—The Poverty of Historicism (1944) and The Open Society and Its Enemies (1945)—offer a kind of unified vision of science and politics.  As explained below, the people and institutions of the open society that Popper envisioned would be imbued with the same critical spirit that marks natural science, an attitude which Popper called critical rationalism. This openness to analysis and questioning was expected to foster social and political progress as well as to provide a political context that would allow the sciences to flourish.

Table of Contents

  1. The Critique of the Closed Society
    1. Open versus Closed Societies
    2. Holism, Essentialism and Historicism
    3. Hegel, Marx and Modern Historicism
    4. Utopian Social Engineering
  2. Freedom, Democracy and the Open Society
    1. Minimalist Democracy
    2. Piecemeal Social Engineering
    3. Negative Utilitarianism
    4. Libertarian, Conservative or Social Democrat?
  3. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Literature
    2. Secondary Literature

1. The Critique of the Closed Society

A central aim of The Open Society and Its Enemies as well as The Poverty of Historicism was to explain the origin and nature of totalitarianism. In particular, the rise of fascism, including in Popper’s native Austria, and the ensuing Second World War prompted Popper to begin writing these two essays in the late 1930s and early 1940s, while he was teaching in New Zealand. He described these works as his “war effort” (Unended Quest, 115).

The arguments in the two essays overlap a great deal. (In fact, The Open Society began as a chapter for Poverty.) Yet there is a difference in emphasis.  The Poverty of Historicism is concerned principally with the methodology of the social sciences, and, in particular, how a flawed idea, which Popper dubbed “historicism,” had led historians and social scientists astray methodologically and which also served as a handmaiden to tyranny. The Open Society, a much longer and, according to Popper, a more important work, included in-depth discussion of historicism and the methods of the social sciences. But it also featured an inquiry into the psychological and historical origins of totalitarianism, which he located in the nexus of a set of appealing but, he argued, false ideas. These included not only historicism but also what he labeled “holism” and “essentialism.” Together they formed the philosophical substrate of what Popper called the “closed society.” The “closed society” is what leads to totalitarianism.

a. Open versus Closed Societies

According to Popper, totalitarianism was not unique to the 20th century. Rather, it “belongs to a tradition which is just as old or just as young as our civilization itself” (Open Society, Vol. I, 1). In The Open Society, Popper’s search for the roots of totalitarianism took him back to ancient Greece. There he detected the emergence of what he called the first “open society” in democratic Athens of the 5th century B.C.E., Athenians, he argued, were the first to subject their own values, beliefs, institutions and traditions to critical scrutiny and Socrates and the city’s democratic politics exemplified this new attitude. But reactionary forces were unnerved by the instability and rapid social change that an open society had unleashed. (Socrates was indicted on charges of corrupting the youth and introducing new gods.) They sought to turn back the clock and return Athens to a society marked by rigid class hierarchy, conformity to the customs of the tribe, and uncritical deference to authority and tradition—a “closed society.” This move back to tribalism was motivated by a widely and deeply felt uneasiness that Popper called the “strain of civilization.” The structured and organic character of closed societies helps to satisfy a deep human need for regularity and a shared common life, Popper said.  In contrast, the individualism, freedom and personal responsibility that open societies necessarily engender leave many feeling isolated and anxious, but this anxiety, Popper said, must be born if we are to enjoy the greater benefits of living in an open society: freedom, social progress, growing knowledge, and enhanced cooperation. “It is the price we have to pay for being human” (Open Society Vol. 1, 176).

Popper charged that Plato emerged as the philosophical champion of the closed society and in the process laid the groundwork for totalitarianism. Betraying the open and critical temper of his mentor Socrates, in his Republic Plato devised an elaborate system that would arrest all political and social change and turn philosophy into an enforcer, rather than a challenger, of authority.  It would also reverse the tide of individualism and egalitarianism that had emerged in democratic Athens, establishing a hierarchical system in which the freedom and rights of the individual would be sacrificed to the collective needs of society.

Popper noted that Plato’s utopian vision in the Republic was in part inspired by Sparta, Athen’s enemy in the Peloponnesian War and, for Popper, an exemplar of the closed society. Spartan society focused almost exclusively on two goals: internal stability and military prowess. Toward these ends, the Spartan constitution sought to create a hive-like, martial society that always favored the needs of the collective over the individual and required a near total control over its citizenry. This included a primitive eugenics, in which newborn infants deemed insufficiently vigorous were tossed into a pit of water. Spartan males judged healthy enough to merit life were separated from their families at a young age and provided an education consisting mainly of military training. The training produced fearsome warriors who were indifferent to suffering, submissive to authority, and unwaveringly loyal to the city. Fighting for the city was an honor granted solely to the male citizenry, while the degrading toil of cultivating the land was the lot reserved to an enslaved tribe of fellow Greeks, the helots. Rigid censorship was imposed on the citizenry, as well as laws that strictly limited contact with foreigners. Under this system, Sparta became a dominant military power in ancient Greece, but, unsurprisingly, made no significant contributions to the arts and sciences. Popper described Sparta as an “arrested tribalism” that sought to stymie “equalitarian, democratic and individualistic ideologies,” such as found in Athens (Open Society Vol. 1, 182). It was no coincidence, he said, that the Nazis and other modern-day totalitarians were also inspired by the Spartans.

b. Holism, Essentialism and Historicism

Popper charged that three deep philosophical predispositions underpinned Plato’s defense of the closed society and, indeed, subsequent defenses of the closed society during the next two-and-a-half millennia. These ideas were holism, essentialism, and historicism.

Holism may be defined as the view that adequate understanding of certain kinds of entities requires understanding them as a whole. This is often held to be true for biological and social systems, for example, an organism, an ecosystem, an economy, or a culture.  A corollary that is typically held to follow from this view is that such entities have properties that cannot be reduced to the entities’ constituent parts. For instance, some philosophers argue that human consciousness is an emergent phenomenon whose properties cannot be explained solely by the properties of the physical components (nerve cells, neurotransmitters, and so forth) that comprise the human brain. Similarly, those who advocate a holistic approach to social inquiry argue that social entities cannot be reduced to the properties of the individuals that comprise them. That is, they reject methodological individualism and support methodological holism, as Popper called it.

Plato’s holism, Popper argued, was reflected in his view that the city—the Greek polis—was prior to and, in a sense, more real than the individuals who resided in it. For Plato “[o]nly a stable whole, the permanent collective, has reality, not the passing individuals” (Open Society Vol. 1, 80). This view in turn implied that the city has real needs that supersede those of individuals and was thus the source of Plato’s ethical collectivism.  According to Popper, Plato believed that a just society required individuals to sacrifice their needs to the interests of the state. “Justice for [Plato],” he wrote, “is nothing but health, unity and stability of the collective body” (OSE I, 106). Popper saw this as profoundly dangerous. In fact, he said, the view that some collective social entity—be it, for example, a city, a state, society, a nation, or a race—has needs that are prior and superior to the needs of actual living persons is a central ethical tenet of all totalitarian systems, whether ancient or modern. Nazis, for instance, emphasized the needs of the Aryan race to justify their brutal policies, whereas communists in the Soviet Union spoke of class aims and interests as the motor of history to which the individual must bend. The needs of the race or class superseded the needs of individuals. In contrast, Popper held, members of an open society see the state and other social institutions as human designed, subject to rational scrutiny, and always serving the interests of individuals—and never the other way around. True justice entails equal treatment of individuals rather than Plato’s organistic view, in which justice is identified as a well functioning state.

Also abetting Plato’s support for a closed society was a doctrine that Popper named “methodological essentialism”. Adherents of this view claim “that it is the task of pure knowledge or ‘science’ to discover and to describe the true nature of things, i.e., their hidden reality or essence” (Open Society Vol. 1, 31).  Plato’s theory of the Forms exemplified this approach.  According to Plato, understanding of any kind of thing—for example, a bed, a triangle, a human being, or a city—requires understanding what Plato called its Form. The Forms are timeless, unchanging and perfect exemplars of sensible things found in our world. Coming to understand a Form, Plato believed, requires rational examination of its essence. Such understanding is governed by a kind of intuition rather than empirical inquiry. For instance, mathematical intuition provides the route to understanding the essential nature of triangles—that is, their Form—as opposed to attempting to understand the nature of triangles by measuring and comparing actual sensible triangles found in our world.

Although Forms are eternal and unchanging, Plato held that the imperfect copies of them that we encounter in the sensible world invariably undergo decay. Extending this theory presented a political problem for Plato. In fact, according to Popper, the disposition to decay was the core political problem that Plato’s philosophy sought to remedy. The very nature of the world is such that human beings and the institutions that they create tend to degrade over time. For Plato, this included cities, which he believed were imperfect copies of the Form of the city. This view of the city, informed by Plato’s methodological essentialism, produced a peculiar political science, Popper argued. It required, first, understanding the true and best nature of the city, that is, its Form. Second, in order to determine how to arrest (or at least slow) the city’s decay from its ideal nature, the study of politics must seek to uncover the laws or principles that govern the city’s natural tendency towards decay and thereby to halt the degradation. Thus Plato’s essentialism led him to seek a theory of historical change—a theory that brings order and intelligibility to the constant flux of our world. That is, Plato’s essentialism led to what Popper labeled “historicism.”

Historicism is the view that history is governed by historical laws or principles and, further, that history has a necessary direction and end-point. This being so, historicists believe that the aim of philosophy—and, later, history and social science—must be to predict the future course of society by uncovering the laws or principles that govern history. Historicism is a very old view, Popper said, predating Athens of the 5th century B.C.E. Early Greek versions of historicism held that the development of cities naturally and necessarily moves in cycles: a golden age followed by inevitable decay and collapse, which in some versions paves the way for rebirth and a new golden age.  In Plato’s version of this “law of decay,” the ideal city by turns degenerates from timarchy (rule by a military class) to oligarchy to democracy and then, finally, dictatorship. But Plato did not merely describe the gradual degeneration of the city; he offered a philosophical explanation of it, which relied upon his theory of the Forms and thus methodological essentialism. Going further, Plato sought to provide a way to arrest this natural tendency toward decay. This, Popper argued, was the deep aim of the utopian society developed in the Republic—a newly fabricated closed society as the solution to natural tendency toward moral and political decline. It required creation of a rigid and hierarchical class society governed by philosopher kings, whose knowledge of the Forms would stave off decay as well as ensure the rulers’ incorruptibility. Tumultuous democratic Athens would be replaced with a stable and unchanging society. Plato saw this as justice, but Popper argued that it had all the hallmarks of totalitarianism, including rigid hierarchy, censorship, collectivism, central planning—all of which would be reinforced through propaganda and deception, or, as Plato called them, “noble lies.”

Plato’s deep mistrust of democracy was no doubt in part a product of experience. As a young man he saw the citizens of Athens, under the influence of demagogues, back ill-advised military campaigns that ultimately led to the Spartan victory over the city in 404 B.C.E. After democracy was reestablished following the Spartan occupiers’ departure in 403 B.C.E., he witnessed the Athenian people’s vote to execute its wisest citizen, Socrates.  Popper as a young man had also witnessed the collapse of democracy, in his native Austria and throughout Europe. But he drew very different lessons from that experience. For him, democracy remained a bulwark against tyranny, not its handmaiden.  For reasons explained in the next section, Popper held that by rejecting democracy Plato’s system destroyed not only individual freedom but also the conditions for social, political, scientific and moral progress.

Popper’s criticism of Plato sparked a lively and contentious debate. Prior to publication of The Open Society, Plato was widely regarded as the wellspring of enlightened humanism in the Western tradition.  Popper’s recasting of Plato as a proto-fascist was scandalous. Classists rose to Plato’s defense and accused Popper of reading Plato ahistorically, using dubious or tendentious translations of his words, and failing to appreciate the ironic and literary elements in Plato’s dialogues. These criticisms exposed errors in Popper’s scholarship. But Popper was nonetheless successful in drawing attention to potential totalitarian dangers of Plato’s utopianism. Subsequent scholarship could not avoid addressing his arguments.

Although Plato was the principle target of Popper’s criticisms in the Open Society, he also detected dangerous tendencies in other ancient Greek philosophers’ ideas, most notably Aristotle’s. Plato’s greatest student, Popper argued, had inherited his teacher’s essentialism but had given it a teleological twist. Like Plato, Aristotle believed that knowledge of an entity required grasping its essence. However, Plato and Aristotle differed in their understanding of the relationship between an entity’s essence and how that essence was manifested in the sensible world. Plato held that the entities found in the sensible world were imperfect, decaying representation of the Forms. Thus his understanding of history, Popper argued, was ultimately pessimistic: the world degrades over time. Plato’s politics was an attempt to arrest or at least slow this degradation.  In contrast, Aristotle understood an entity’s essence as a bundle of potentialities that become manifest as the entity develops through time. An entity’s essence acts as a kind of internal motor that impels the entity toward its fullest development, or what Aristotle called its final cause. The oak tree, for example, is the final cause of an acorn, the end towards which it strives.

Herein Popper detected an implicit historicism in Aristotle’s epistemology. Though Aristotle himself produced no theory of history, his essentialism wedded to his teleology naturally lent itself to the notion that a person’s or a state’s true nature can only be understood as it is revealed through time. “Only if a person or a state develops, and only by way of its history, can we get to know anything about its ‘hidden undeveloped essence’” (Open Society Vol. 1I, 7). Further, Popper argued that Aristotle’s essentialism naturally aligned with the notion of historical destiny: a state’s or a nation’s development is predetermined by its “hidden undeveloped essence.”

Popper believed that he had revealed deep links between ancient Greek philosophy and hostility toward the open society. In Plato’s essentialism, collectivism, holism and historicism, Popper detected the philosophical underpinning for Plato’s ancient totalitarian project. As we shall see in the next section, Popper argued that these very same ideas were at the heart of modern totalitarianism, too. Though for Popper Plato was the most important ancient enemy of the open society, in Aristotle’s teleological essentialism Popper found a key link connecting ancient and modern historicism. In fact, the idea of historical destiny that Aristotle’s thought generated was at the core of the thought of two 19th century philosophers, G.W.F. Hegel and Karl Marx, whom Popper charged with facilitating the emergence of modern closed societies. The “far-reaching historicist consequences” of Aristotle’s essentialism “were slumbering for more than twenty centuries, ‘hidden and undeveloped’,” until the advent of Hegel’s philosophical system (Open Society Vol. 1, 8).

c. Hegel, Marx and Modern Historicism

History was central to both Hegel’s and Marx’s philosophy, and for Popper their ideas exemplified historicist thinking and the political dangers that it entailed. Hegel’s historicism was reflected in his view that the dialectal interaction of ideas was the motor of history. The evolution and gradual improvement of philosophical, ethical, political and religious ideas determines the march of history, Hegel argued. History, which Hegel sometimes described as the gradual unfolding of “Reason,” comes to an end when all the internal contradictions in human ideas are finally resolved.

Marx’s historical materialism famously inverted Hegel’s philosophy. For Marx, history was a succession of economic and political systems, or “modes of production” in Marx’s language. As technological innovations and new ways of organizing production led to improvements in a society’s capacity to meet human material needs, new modes of production would emerge. In each new mode of production, the political and legal system, as well as the dominant moral and religious values and practices, would reflect the interests of those who controlled the new productive system. Marx believed that the capitalist mode of production was the penultimate stage of human history. The productive power unleashed by new technologies and factory production under capitalism was ultimately incompatible with capitalism as an economic and political system, which was marked by inefficiency, instability and injustice.  Marx predicted that these flaws would inevitably lead to revolution followed by establishment of communist society. This final stage of human development would be one of material abundance and true freedom and equality for all.

According to Popper, though they disagreed on the mechanism that directed human social evolution, both Hegel and Marx, like Plato, were historicists because they believed that trans-historical laws governed human history.  This was the key point for Popper, as well as the key error and danger.

The deep methodological flaw of historicism, according to Popper, is that historicists wrongly see the goal of social science as historical forecast—to predict the general course of history. But such prediction is not possible, Popper said. He provided two arguments that he said demonstrated its impossibility. The first was a succinct logical argument: Human knowledge grows and changes overtime, and knowledge in turn affects social events. (That knowledge might be, for example, a scientific theory, a social theory, or an ethical or religious idea.) We cannot predict what we will know in the future (otherwise we would already know it), therefore we cannot predict the future.  As long as it is granted that knowledge affects social behavior and that knowledge changes overtime—two premises that Popper considered incontestable—then the view that we can predict the future cannot be true and historicism must be rejected. This argument, it should be noted, also reflected Popper’s judgment that the universe is nondeterministic: that is, he believed that prior conditions and the laws of nature do not completely causally determine the future, including human ideas and actions. Our universe is an “open” universe, he said.

Popper’s second argument against the possibility of historical forecasting focused on the role of laws in social explanations. According to Popper, historicists wrongly believe that genuine social science must be a kind of “theoretical history” in which the aim is to uncover laws of historical development that explain and predict the course of history (Poverty of Historicism, 39). But Popper contended that this represents a fundamental misunderstanding of scientific laws. In fact, Popper argued, there is no such thing as a law of historical development. That is, there are no trans-historical laws that determine the transition from one historical period to the next.  Failure to understand why this is so represented a deep philosophical error. There may be sociological laws that govern human behavior within particular social systems or institutions, Popper said. For instance, the laws of supply and demand are kinds of social laws governing market economies. But the future course of history cannot be predicted and, in particular, laws that govern the general trajectory of history do not exist. Popper does not deny that there can be historical trends—a tendency towards greater freedom and equality, more wealth or better technology, for instance, but unlike genuine laws, trends are always dependent upon conditions. Change the conditions and the trends may alter or disappear. A trend towards greater freedom or knowledge could be disrupted by, say, the outbreak of a pandemic disease or the emergence of a new technology that facilitates authoritarian regimes. Popper acknowledges that in certain cases natural scientists can predict the future—even the distance future—with some confidence, as is the case with astronomy, for instance. But this type of successful long-range forecasting can occur only in physical systems that are “well-isolated, stationary and recurrent,” such as the solar system (Conjectures and Refutations, 339). Social systems can never be isolated and stationary, however.

d. Utopian Social Engineering

So historicism as social science is deeply defective, according to Popper. But he also argued that it was politically dangerous and that this danger stemmed from historicism’s natural and close allegiance with what Popper called “utopian social engineering.” Such social planning “aims at remodeling the ‘whole of society’ in accordance with a definite plan or blueprint,” as opposed to social planning that aims at gradual and limited adjustments. Popper admitted that the alliance between historicism and utopian engineering was “somewhat strange” (Poverty of Historicism, 73). Because historicists believe that laws determine the course of history, from their vantage it is ultimately pointless to try to engineer social change. Just as a meteorologist can forecast the weather, but not alter it, the same holds for social scientists, historicists believe. They can predict future social developments, but not cause or alter them. Thus “out-and-out historicism” is against utopian planning—or even against social planning altogether (Open Society Vol. 1, 157). For this reason Marx rejected attempts to design a socialist system; in fact he derided such projects as “utopian.” Nonetheless, the connection between historicism and utopian planning remains strong, Popper insisted. Why?

First, historicism and utopian engineering share a connection to utopianism. Utopians seek to establish an ideal state of some kind, one in which all conflicts in social life are resolved and ultimate human ends—for example, freedom, equality, true happiness—are somehow reconciled and fully realized. Attaining this final goal requires radical overhaul of the existing social world and thus naturally suggests the need for utopian social engineering.  Many versions of historicism are thus inclined towards utopianism. As noted above, both Marx’s and Hegel’s theory of history, for instance, predict an end to history in which all social contradictions will be permanently resolved. Second, historicism and utopian social engineering both tend to embrace holism. Popper said that historicists, like utopian engineers, typically believe that “society as a whole” is the proper object of scientific inquiry. For the historicist, society must be understood in terms of social wholes, and to understand the deep forces that move the social wholes, you must understand the laws of history. Thus the historicists’ anticipation of the coming utopia, and their knowledge of the historical tendencies that will bring it about, may tempt them to try to intervene in the historical process and therefore, as Marx said, “lessen the birth pangs” associated with the arrival of the new social order. So while a philosophically consistent historicism might seem to lead to political quiescence, the fact is that historicists often cannot resist political engagement. In addition, Popper noted that even less radical versions of historicism, such as Plato’s, permit human intervention.

Popper argued that utopian engineering, though superficially attractive, is fatally flawed: it invariably leads to multitudinous unintended and usually unwelcome consequences. The social world is so complex, and our understanding of it so incomplete, that the full impact of any imposed change to it, especially grand scale change, can never be foreseen. But, because of their unwarranted faith in their historical prophesies, the utopian engineers will be methodologically ill equipped to deal with this reality. The unintended consequences will be unanticipated, and he or she will be forced to respond to them in a haphazard and ill-informed manner: “[T]he greater the holistic changes attempted, the greater are their unintended and largely unexpected repercussions, forcing on the holistic engineer the expedient of piecemeal improvisation” or the “notorious phenomenon of unplanned planning (Poverty of Historicism, 68-69). One particularly important cause of unintended consequences that utopian engineers are generally blind to is what Popper called the “human factor” in all institutional design. Institutions can never wholly govern individuals’ behavior, he said, as human choice and human idiosyncrasies will ensure this. Thus no matter how thoroughly and carefully an institution is designed, the fact that institutions are filled with human beings results in a certain degree of unpredictability in their operation. But the historicists’ holism leads them to believe that individuals are merely pawns in the social system, dragged along by larger social forces outside their control. The effect of the human factor is that utopian social engineers inevitably are forced, despite themselves, to try to alter human nature itself in their bid to transform society. Their social plan “substitutes for [the social engineers’] demand that we build a new society, fit for men and women to live in, the demand that we ‘mould’ these men and women to fit into this new society” (Poverty of Historicism, 70).

Achieving such molding requires awesome and total power and thus in this way utopian engineering naturally tends toward the most severe authoritarian dictatorship. But this is not the only reason that utopian engineering and tyranny are allied. The central planning that it requires invariably concentrates power in the hands of the few, or even the one. This is why even utopian projects that officially embrace democracy tend towards authoritarianism. Authoritarian societies are in turn hostile to any public criticism, which deprives the planners of needed feedback about the impact of their policies, which further undermines the effectiveness of utopian engineering. In addition, Popper argued that the utopian planners’ historicism makes them indifferent to the misery that their plans cause. Having uncovered what they believe is inevitable en route to utopia, they all too easily countenance any suffering as a necessary part of that process, and, moreover, they will be inclined to see such suffering as outweighed by the benefits that will flow to all once utopia is reached.

Popper’s discussion of utopian engineering and its link to historicism is highly abstract. His criticisms are generally aimed at “typical” historicists and utopian planners, rather than actual historical or contemporary figures.  This reluctance to name names is somewhat surprising, given that Popper himself later stated that the political disasters of the 1930s and 40s were the impetus for his foray into political philosophy. Exactly whom did Popper think was guilty of social science malpractice? A contemporary reader with a passing familiarity with 20th-century history is bound to suppose that Popper had in mind the horrors of the Soviet Union when he discussed utopian planning. Indeed, the attempts to transform the Soviet Union into a modern society—the “five year plans,” rapid industrialization, collectivization of agriculture, and so forth—would seem to feature all the elements of utopian engineering. They were fueled by Marxist historicism and utopianism, centrally planned, aimed at wholesale remodeling of Russian society, and even sought to create a new type of person—“New Soviet Man”—through indoctrination and propaganda. Moreover, the utopian planning had precisely the pernicious effects that Popper predicted. The Soviet Union soon morphed into a brutal dictatorship under Stalin, criticism of the leadership and their programs was ruthlessly suppressed, and the various ambitious social projects were bedeviled by massive unintended consequences. The collectivization of agriculture, for instance, led to a precipitous drop in agricultural production and some 10 million deaths, partly from the unintended consequence of mass starvation and partly from the Soviet leaders’ piecemeal improvisation of murdering incorrigible peasants. However, when writing Poverty and The Open Society, Popper regarded the Soviet experiments, at least the early ones, as examples of piecemeal social planning rather than the utopian kind. His optimistic assessment is no doubt explained partly by his belief at the time that the Russian revolution was a progressive event, and he was thus reluctant to criticize the Soviet Union (Hacohen, 396-397). In any event, the full horrors of the Soviet social experiments were not yet known to the wider world. In addition, the Soviets during the Second World War were part of the alliance against fascism, which Popper saw as a much greater threat to humanity. In fact, initially Popper viewed totalitarianism as an exclusively right-wing phenomenon. However, he later became a unambiguous opponent of Soviet-style communism, and he dedicated the 1957 publication in book form of The Poverty of Historicism to the “memory of the countless men, women and children of all creeds or nations or races who fell victims to the fascist and communist belief in Inexorable Laws of Historical Destiny.”

2. Freedom, Democracy and the Open Society 

Having uncovered what he believed were the underlying psychological forces abetting totalitarianism (the strain of civilization) as well as the flawed philosophical ideas (historicism, holism and essentialism), Popper provided his own account of the values and institutions needed to sustain an open society in the contemporary world.  He viewed modern Western liberal democracies as open societies and defended them as “the best of all political worlds of whose existence we have any historical knowledge” (All Life Is Problem Solving, 90). For Popper, their value resided principally in the individual freedom that they permitted and their ability to self-correct peacefully over time. That they were democratic and generated great prosperity was merely an added benefit. What gives the concept of an open society its interest is not so much the originality of the political system that Popper advocated, but rather the novel grounds on which he developed and defended this political vision. Popper’s argument for a free and democratic society is anchored in a particular epistemology and understanding of the scientific method. He held that all knowledge, including knowledge of the social world, was conjectural and that freedom and social progress ultimately depended upon the scientific method, which is merely a refined and institutionalized process of trial and error.  Liberal democracies in a sense both embodied and fostered this understanding of knowledge and science.

a. Minimalist Democracy

Popper’s view of democracy was simple, though not simplistic, and minimalist. Rejecting the question Who should rule? as the fundamental question of political theory, Popper proposed a new question: “How can we so organize political institutions that bad or incompetent rulers can be prevented from doing too much damage?” (Open Society Vol. 1, 121). This is fundamentally a question of institutional design, Popper said. Democracy happens to be the best type of political system because it goes a long way toward solving this problem by providing a nonviolent, institutionalized and regular way to get rid of bad rulers—namely by voting them out of office. For Popper, the value of democracy did not reside in the fact that the people are sovereign. (And, in any event, he said, “the people do not rule anywhere, it is always governments that rule” [All Life Is Problem Solving, 93]). Rather, Popper defended democracy principally on pragmatic or empirical grounds, not on the “essentialist” view that democracy by definition is rule by the people or on the view that there is something intrinsically valuable about democratic participation. With this move, Popper is able to sidestep altogether a host of traditional questions of democratic theory, e.g.. On what grounds are the people sovereign? Who, exactly, shall count as “the people”? How shall they be represented? The role of the people is simply to provide a regular and nonviolent way to get rid of incompetent, corrupt or abusive leaders.

Popper devoted relatively little thought toward the design of the democratic institutions that permit people to remove their leaders or otherwise prevent them from doing too much harm. But he did emphasize the importance of instituting checks and balances into the political system. Democracies must seek “institutional control of the rulers by balancing their power against other powers” (Ibid.) This idea, which was a key component of the “new science” of politics in the 18th century, was expressed most famously by James Madison in Federalist Paper #51.  “A dependence on the people is, no doubt, the primary control on the government,” Madison wrote, “but experience has taught mankind the necessity of auxiliary precautions.” That is, government must be designed such that “ambition must be made to counteract ambition.” Popper also argued that two-party systems, such as found in the United States and Great Britain, are superior to proportional representation systems; he reasoned that in a two-party system voters are more easily able to assign failure or credit to a particular political party, that is, the one in power at the time of an election. This in turn fosters self-criticism in the defeated party: “Under such a system … parties are from time to time forced to learn from their mistakes” (All Life Is Problem Solving, 97). For these reasons, government in a two-party system better mirrors the trial-and-error process found in science, leading to better public policy. In contrast, Popper argued that proportional representation systems typically produce multiple parties and coalitional governments in which no single party has control of the government. This makes it difficult for voters to assign responsibility for public policy and thus elections are less meaningful and government less responsive. (It should be noted that Popper ignored that divided government is a typical outcome in the U.S. system. It is relevantly infrequent for one party to control the presidency along with both chambers of the U.S. congress, thus making it difficult for voters to determine responsibility for public policy successes and failures.)

Importantly, Popper’s theory of democracy did not rely upon a well-informed and judicious public. It did not even require that the public, though ill-informed, nonetheless exercises a kind of collective wisdom. In fact, Popper explicitly rejected vox populi vox dei as a “classical myth”. “We are democrats,” Popper wrote, “not because the majority is always right, but because democratic traditions are the least evil ones of which we know” (Conjectures and Refutations, 351). Better than any other system, democracies permit the change of government without bloodshed. Nonetheless Popper expressed the hope that public opinion and the institutions that influence it (universities, the press, political parties, cinema, television, and so forth) could become more rational overtime by embracing the scientific tradition of critical discussion—that is, the willingness to submit one’s ideas to public criticism and habit of listening to another person’s point of view.

b. Piecemeal Social Engineering

So the chief role of the citizen in Popper’s democracy is the small but important one of removing bad leaders. How then is public policy to be forged and implemented? Who forges it? What are its goals? Here Popper introduced the concept of “piecemeal social engineering,” which he offered as a superior approach to the utopian engineering described above. Unlike utopian engineering, piecemeal social engineering must be “small scale,” Popper said, meaning that social reform should focus on changing one institution at a time.  Also, whereas utopian engineering aims for lofty and abstract goals (for example, perfect justice, true equality, a higher kind of happiness), piecemeal social engineering seeks to address concrete social problems (for example, poverty, violence, unemployment, environmental degradation, income inequality). It does so through the creation of new social institutions or the redesign of existing ones. These new or reconfigured institutions are then tested through implementation and altered accordingly and continually in light of their effects. Institutions thus may undergo gradual improvement overtime and social ills gradually reduced. Popper compared piecemeal social engineering to physical engineering. Just as physical engineers refine machines through a series of small adjustments to existing models, social engineers gradually improve social institutions through “piecemeal tinkering.” In this way, “[t]he piecemeal method permits repeated experiments and continuous readjustments” (Open Society Vol 1., 163). Only such social experiments, Popper said, can yield reliable feedback for social planners. In contrast, as discussed above, social reform that is wide ranging, highly complex and involves multiple institutions will produce social experiments in which it is too difficult to untangle causes and effects.  The utopian planners suffer from a kind of hubris, falsely and tragically believing that they possess reliable experimental knowledge about how the social world operates.  But the “piecemeal engineer knows, like Socrates, how little he knows. He knows that we can learn only from our mistakes” (Poverty of Historicism, 67).

Thus, as with his defense of elections in a democracy, Popper’s argument for piecemeal social engineering rests principally on its compatibility with the trial-and-error method of the natural sciences: a theory is proposed and tested, errors in the theory are detected and eliminated, and a new, improved theory emerges, starting the cycle over. Via piecemeal engineering, the process of social progress thus parallels scientific progress. Indeed, Popper says that piecemeal social engineering is the only approach to public policy that can be genuinely scientific: “This—and no Utopian planning or historical prophecy—would mean the introduction of scientific method into politics, since the whole secret of scientific method is a readiness to learn from mistakes” (Open Society Vol 1., 163).

c. Negative Utilitarianism

If piecemeal social engineers should target specific social problems, what criteria should they use to determine which problems are most urgent? Here Popper introduced a concept that he dubbed “negative utilitarianism,” which holds that the principal aim of politics should be to reduce suffering rather than to increase happiness. “[I]t is my thesis,” he wrote, “that human misery is the most urgent problem of a rational public policy” (Conjectures and Refutations, 361). He made several arguments in favor of this view.

First, he claimed that there is no moral symmetry between suffering and happiness: “In my opinion … human suffering makes a direct moral appeal, namely, an appeal for help, while there is no similar call to increase the happiness of a man who is doing well anyway” (Open Society Vol. 1, 284). He added:

A further criticism of the Utilitarian formula ‘Maximize pleasure’ is that it assumes, in principle, a continuous pleasure-pain scale which allows us to treat degrees of pain as negative degrees of pleasure. But, from a moral point of view, pain cannot be outweighed by pleasure, and especially not one man’s pain by another man’s pleasure (Ibid.).

In arguing against what we might call “positive utilitarianism,” Popper stressed the dangers of utopianism. Attempts to increase happiness, especially when guided by some ideal of complete or perfect happiness, are bound to lead to perilous utopian political projects. “It leads invariably to the attempt to impose our scale of ‘higher’ values upon others, in order to make them realize what seems to us of greatest importance for their happiness; in order, as it were to save their souls. It leads to Utopianism and Romanticism” (Open Society Vol 11., 237).  In addition, such projects are dangerous because they tend to justify extreme measures, including severe human suffering in the present, as necessary measures to secure a much greater human happiness in the future. “[W]e must not argue that the misery of one generation may be considered as a mere means to the end of securing the lasting happiness of some later generation or generations” (Conjectures and Refutations, 362). Moreover, such projects are doomed to fail anyway, owing to the unintended consequences of social planning and the irreconcilability of the ultimate humans ends of freedom, equality, and happiness. Thus Popper’s rejection of positive utilitarianism becomes part of his broader critique of utopian social engineering, while his advocacy of negative utilitarianism is tied to his support for piecemeal social engineering. It is piecemeal engineering that provides the proper approach to tackling the identifiable, concrete sources of suffering in our world.

Finally, Popper offered the pragmatic argument that negative utilitarianism approach “adds to clarify the field of ethics” by requiring that “we formulate our demands negatively”  (Open Society Vol. 1, 285.). Properly understood, Popper says, the aim of science is “the elimination of false theories … rather than the attainment of established truths” (Ibid.). Similarly, ethical public policy may benefit by aiming at “the elimination of suffering rather than the promotion of happiness” (Ibid.). Popper thought that reducing suffering provides a clearer target for public policy than chasing after the will-o’-the-wisp, never-ending goal of increasing happiness. In addition, he argued, it easier to reach political agreement to combat suffering than to increase happiness, thus making effective public policy more likely. “For new ways of happiness are theoretical, unreal things, about which it may be difficult to form an opinion. But misery is with us, here and now, and it will be with us for a long time to come. We all know it from experience” (Conjectures and Refutations, 346). Popper thus calls for a public policy that aims at reducing and, hopefully, eliminating such readily identifiable and universally agreed upon sources of suffering as “poverty, unemployment, national oppression, war, and disease” (Conjectures and Refutations, 361).

d. Libertarian, Conservative or Social Democrat?

Popper’s political thought would seem to fit most comfortably within the liberal camp, broadly understood. Reason, toleration, nonviolence and individual freedom formed the core of his political values, and, as we have seen, he identified modern liberal democracies as the best-to-date embodiment of an open society. But where, precisely, did he reside within liberalism? Here Popper’s thought is difficult to categorize, as it includes elements of libertarianism, conservatism, and socialism—and, indeed, representatives from each of these schools have claimed him for their side.

The case for Popper’s libertarianism rests mainly on his emphasis on freedom and his hostility to large-scale central planning. He insisted that freedom—understood as individual freedom—is the most important political value and that efforts to impose equality can lead to tyranny. “Freedom is more important than equality,” he wrote, and “the attempt to realize equality endangers freedom” (Unended Quest, 36.) Popper also had great admiration for Friedrich Hayek, the libertarian economist from the so-called Austrian school, and he drew heavily upon his ideas in his critique of central planning. However, Popper also espoused many views that would be anathema to libertarians. Although he acknowledged “the tremendous benefit to be derived from the mechanism of free markets,” he seemed to regard economic freedom as important mainly for its instrumental role in producing wealth rather than as an important end in itself (Open Society Vol 11., 124). Further, he warned of the dangers of unbridled capitalism, even declaring that “the injustice and inhumanity of the unrestrained ‘capitalist system’ described by Marx cannot be questioned” (Ibid.). The state therefore must serve as a counteracting force against the predations of concentrated economic power: “We must construct social institutions, enforced by the power of the state, for the protection of the economically weak from the economically strong” (Open Society Vol 11., 125). This meant that the “principle of non-intervention, of an unrestrained economic system, has to be given up” and replaced by “economic interventionism” (Ibid.)  Such interventionism, which he also called “protectionism,” would be implemented via the piecemeal social engineering described above. This top-down and technocratic vision of politics is hard to reconcile with libertarianism, whose adherents, following Hayek, tend to believe that such social engineering is generally counterproductive, enlarges the power and thus the danger of the state, and violates individual freedom.

It is in this interventionist role for the state where the socialistic elements of Popper’s political theory are most evident. In his intellectual autobiography Unended Quest, Popper says that he was briefly a Marxist in his youth, but soon rejected the doctrine for what he saw as its adherents’ dogmatism and embrace of violence.  Socialism nonetheless remained appealing to him, and he remained a socialist for “several years” after abandoning Marxism (Unended Quest, 36). “For nothing could be better,” he wrote, “than living a modest, simple, and free life in an egalitarian society” (Ibid.). However, eventually he concluded that socialism was “no more than a beautiful dream,” and the dream is undone by the conflict between freedom and equality (Ibid.).

But though Popper saw utopian efforts to create true social and economic equality as dangerous and doomed to fail anyway, he continued to support efforts by the state to reduce and even eliminate the worst effects of capitalism. As we saw above, he advocated the use of piecemeal social engineering to tackle the problems of poverty, unemployment, disease and “rigid class differences.” And it is clear that for Popper the solutions to these problems need not be market-oriented solutions. For instance, he voiced support for establishing a minimum income for all citizens as a means to eliminate poverty. It seems then that his politics put into practice would produce a society more closely resembling the so-called social democracies of northern Europe, with their more generous social welfare programs and greater regulation of industry, than the United States, with its more laissez-faire capitalism and comparatively paltry social welfare programs. That said, it should be noted that in later editions of The Open Society, Popper grew somewhat more leery of direct state intervention to tackle social problems, preferring tinkering with the state’s legal framework, if possible, to address them. He reasoned that direct intervention by the state always empowers the state, which endangers freedom.

Evidence of Popper’s conservatism can be found in his opposition to radical change. His critique of utopian engineering at times seems to echo Edmund Burke’s critique of the French Revolution. Burke depicted the bloodletting of the Terror as an object lesson in the dangers of sweeping aside all institutions and traditions overnight and replacing them with an abstract and untested social blueprint. Also like Burke and other traditional conservatives, Popper emphasized the importance of tradition for ensuring order, stability and well-functioning institutions. People have an inherent need for regularity and thus predictability in their social environment, Popper argued, which tradition is crucial for providing. However, there are important differences between Popper’s and Burke’s understanding of tradition. Popper included Burke, as well as the influential 20th-century conservative Michael Oakeshott, in the camp of the “anti-rationalists.” This is because “their attitude is to accept tradition as something just given”; that is, they “accept tradition uncritically” (Conjectures and Refutations, 120, 122, Popper’s emphasis). Such an attitude treats the values, beliefs and practices of a particular tradition as “taboo.” Popper, in contrast, advocated a “critical attitude” toward tradition (Ibid., Popper’s emphasis). “We free ourselves from the taboo if we think about it, and if we ask ourselves whether we should accept it or reject” (Ibid.). Popper emphasized that a critical attitude does not require stepping outside of all traditions, something Popper denied was possible. Just as criticism in the sciences always targets particular theories and also always takes place from the standpoint of some theory, so to for social criticism with respect to tradition. Social criticism necessarily focuses on particular traditions and does so from the standpoint of a tradition. In fact, the critical attitude toward tradition is itself a tradition -- namely the scientific tradition -- that dates back to the ancient Greeks of the 5th and 6th century B.C.E.

Popper’s theory of democracy also arguably contained conservative elements insofar as it required only a limited role for the average citizen in governing.  As we saw above, the primary role of the public in Popper’s democracy is to render a verdict on the success or failure of a government’s policies. For Popper public policy is not to be created through the kind of inclusive public deliberation envisioned by advocates of radical or participatory democracy. Much less is it to be implemented by ordinary citizens. Popper summed up his view by quoting Pericles, the celebrated statesman of Athenian democracy in 5th-century B.C.E.: “’Even if only a few of us are capable of devising a policy or putting it into practice, all of us are capable of judging it’.” Popper added, “Please note that [this view] discounts the notion of rule by the people, and even of popular initiative. Both are replaced with the very different idea of judgement by the people” (Lessons of This Century, 72, Popper’s emphasis). This view in some ways mirrors traditional conservatives’ support for rule by “natural aristocrats,” as Burke called them, in a democratic society. Ideally, elected officials would be drawn from the class of educated gentlemen, who would be best fit to hold positions of leadership owing to their superior character, judgment and experience.  However, in Popper’s system, good public policy in a democracy would result not so much from the superior wisdom or character of its leadership but rather from their commitment to the scientific method. As discussed above, this entailed implementing policy changes in a piecemeal fashion and testing them through the process of trial and error. Popper’s open society is technocratic rather than aristocratic.

3. References and Further Reading

The key texts for Popper’s political thought are The Open Society and Its Enemies (1945) and The Poverty of Historicism (1944/45). Popper continued to write and speak about politics until his death in 1994, but his later work was mostly refinement of the ideas that he developed in those two seminal essays.  Much of that refinement is contained in Conjectures and Refutations (1963), a collection of essays and addresses from the 1940s and 50s that includes in-depth discussions of public opinion, tradition and liberalism. These and other books and essay collections by Popper that include sustained engagement with political theory are listed below:

a. Primary Literature

  • Popper, Karl. 1945/1966. The Open Society and Its Enemies, Vol. 1, Fifth Edition. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Popper, Karl. 1945/1966. The Open Society and Its Enemies, Vol. I1, Fifth Edition. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Popper, Karl.1957. The Poverty of Historicism. London: Routledge.
    • A revised version of “The Poverty of Historicism,” first published in the journal Economica in three parts in 1944 and 1945.
  • Popper, Karl. 1963/1989. Conjectures and Refutations. Fifth Edition. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Popper, Karl. 1976. Unended Quest. London: Open Court.
    • Popper’s intellectual autobiography.
  • Popper, Karl.1985. Popper Selections. David Miller (ed.). Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • Contains excerpts from The Open Society and The Poverty of Historicism, as well as a few other essays on politics and history.
  • Popper, Karl. 1994. In Search of a Better World. London: Routledge.
    • Parts II and III contain, respectively, essays on the role of culture clash in the emergence of open societies and the responsibility of intellectuals.
  • Popper, Karl. 1999. All Life Is Problem Solving. London: Routledge.
    • Part II of this volume contains essays and speeches on history and politics, mostly from the 1980s and 90s.
  • Popper, Karl. 2000. The Lessons of This Century. London: Routledge.
    • A collection of interviews with Popper, dating from 1991 and 1993, on politics, plus two addresses from late1980s on democracy, freedom and intellectual responsibility.

b. Secondary Literature

  • Bambrough, Renford. (ed.). 1967. Plato, Popper, and Politics: Some Contributions to a Modern Controversy. New York: Barnes and Noble
    • Contains essays addressing Popper’s controversial interpretation of Plato.
  • Corvi, Roberta. 1997. An Introduction to the Thought of Karl Popper. London: Routledge.
    • Emphasizes connections between Popper’s epistemological, metaphysical and political works.
  • Currie, Gregory, and Alan Musgrave (eds.). 1985. Popper and the Human Sciences. Dordrecht: Martinus Nijhoff Plublishers.
    • Essays on Popper’s contribution to the philosophy of social science.
  • Frederic, Raphael. 1999. Popper. New York: Routledge.
    • This short monograph offers a lively, sympathetic but critical tour through Popper’s critique of historicism and utopian planning.
  • Hacohen, Malachi Haim. 2000. Karl Popper: The Formative Years, 1902-1945. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • This definitive and exhaustive biography of the young Popper unveils the historical origins of his thought.
  • Jarvie, Ian and Sandra Pralong (eds.). 1999. Popper’s Open Society after 50 Years. London: Routledge.
    • A collection of essays exploring and critiquing key ideas of The Open Society and applying them to contemporary political problems.
  • Magee, Brian. 1973. Popper. London: Fontana/Collins.
    • A brief and accessible introduction to Popper’s philosophy.
  • Notturno, Mark. 2000. Science and Open Society. New York: Central European University Press.
    • Examines connections between Popper’s anti-inductivism and anti-positivism and his social and political values, including opposition to institutionalized science, intellectual authority and communism.
  • Schilp, P.A. (ed.) 1974. The Philosophy of Karl Popper. 2 vols. La Salle, IL: Open Court.
    • Essays by various authors that explore and critique his philosophy, including his political thought. Popper’s replies to the essays are included.
  • Shearmur, Jeremey. 1995. The Political Thought of Karl Popper. London: Routledge.
    • Argues that the logic of Popper’s own ideas should have made him more leery of state intervention and more receptive to classical liberalism.
  • Stokes, Geoffrey. 1998. Popper: Philosophy, Politics and Scientific Method. Cambridge: Polity Press.
    • Argues that we need to consider Popper’s political values to understand the unity of his philosophy.


Author Information

William Gorton
Alma College
U. S. A.

Robert Nozick: Political Philosophy 

NozickAlthough Robert Nozick did not consider himself to be primarily a political philosopher, he is best known for his contributions to it. Undoubtedly, Nozick’s work in epistemology and metaphysics (especially with respect to free will and the “closest continuer” theory of personal identity) has had a significant impact on those fields. However, it was the publication of his first book, Anarchy, State and Utopia (1974) that revitalized the political right-wing and set off a firestorm of critical replies and commentaries. While Nozick’s accomplishments reach far beyond the confines of political philosophy, it is safe to say that most recognize him for his work on attempting to provide a justification for the state, setting the limits of government, and trying to convince us that accepting his minimal state could foster a framework for a constellation of communities constituting a sort of utopia.

Anarchy, State and Utopia can also be seen as a critical response to John Rawls’ Theory of Justice, which was published just three years earlier and was considered to be the most robust and sophisticated defense of liberal egalitarianism. Although many credit Rawls for single-handedly rekindling interest in political philosophy, this is likely overstated praise. There is little doubt that Nozick’s systematic criticism of Rawls’ theory of justice and establishment of a rival political theory in Anarchy, State and Utopia also played a major role in bring significant attention back to political philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Libertarianism versus Conservatism and Nozick's Appeal to Capitalists
  3. Anarchy, State and Utopia
    1. An Invisible Hand Justification of the State
    2. Individual Rights and the Nature of the Minimal State
    3. Self-Ownership Argument
    4. Separateness of Persons
    5. The Three Principles of Justice
    6. The Wilt Chamberlain and "Sunset/Yacht Lover" Examples
    7. The Experience Machine
    8. The Lockean Proviso
    9. Utopia
  4. Later Thought on Libertarianism
  5. References and Future Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Robert Nozick was born of Jewish immigrants in Brooklyn, New York in 1938 and died in 2002 of stomach cancer. He was a philosopher of wide-ranging interests who worked in metaphysics, epistemology, decision theory, political philosophy, and value theory more generally. Early in his career, Nozick taught at Princeton and Rockefeller Universities, but he spent the vast majority of his career on the faculty at Harvard. Nozick was unique in his approach to philosophy. While he is most properly thought of as an analytic philosopher, throughout his career he increasingly resisted the usual tactic in the discipline to argue from sure premises to a definite conclusion. Instead, Nozick tried to detail plausible explanatory theories to properly describe phenomena and to provide viable alternatives to conventional wisdom. He thought that the aim of philosophy shouldn’t necessarily be to convince opponents that a particular theory is true. Instead, Nozick saw philosophy as an exploratory venture of making connections between ideas and explaining how things could be as they are. This does not mean that he shirked the responsibility of engaging in rigorous analysis of concepts and when warranted he used technical arguments to make highly sophisticated points. It is also noteworthy that Nozick used work from several disciplines outside of philosophy to enhance his scholarship within it. He incorporated insights from economics, evolutionary biology, Buddhism, and moral psychology to clarify his theoretical work and sometimes ground it in empirical studies.

With respect to political philosophy, Nozick was a right-libertarian, which in short means he accepted the idea that individuals own themselves and have a right to private property. While he argued that the state is legitimate, he thought that only a very scaled-down version that provides security to individuals and protects private property can be justified. Nozick’s version of legitimate government is sometimes called the “nightwatchman” state which underscores what he saw as its essential function: to protect individuals and their private property. This means that to properly respect contracts and resolve property disputes, a judiciary is necessary and with respect to protecting persons and their property, a police force and a military are legitimate and citizens may justifiably be taxed to support these basic functions. However, no more expansive function of the state can be justified according to Nozick, which means that taxation aimed at building funds to be redistributed for welfare purposes (for example, health care, education, poverty relief) are all illegitimate. This is very different from the political theory of his one time Harvard colleague John Rawls. Rawls argued that in addition to protecting the basic liberties, it is legitimate for the state to use its coercive powers (via redistributive taxation) to maximize the position of the least well-off.

2. Libertarianism versus Conservatism and Nozick's Appeal to Capitalists

What Nozick did share with Rawls is that he was part of the liberal political tradition, which places a premium on the individual and opposes the idea that the state’s function is to make its citizens moral. Instead, for liberals in political theory such as both Rawls and Nozick, the state exists to provide the appropriate conditions for individuals to define the good life for themselves (just so long as they don’t impede the ability of others to do the same). Notice that the labels are a bit confusing here. For political theorists “liberal” refers to the political tradition of Hobbes, Locke, Rousseau, and Kant. This is different from what “liberal” means in party politics in America (where “liberal” is associated with the Democratic Party).

Once more, while Nozick has been held up as a champion of conservatives in party politics (especially among fiscal ones) at the time of its publication, Anarchy, State and Utopia is best thought of specifically as a right-libertarian tract. In fact, Nozick’s political ideas diverge quite radically from those thought of as “conservative” in political theory. For example, the usual markings of conservatism in political theory include veneration of custom, trust of long standing traditions, and skepticism of wholesale political reform. Conservative political thinkers also usually insist that authority is crucial because it yields societal stability. However, none of these could plausibly be construed as traits of a Nozickian state. Nozick’s political philosophy does not explicitly refer to custom or tradition at all. In fact, if the result of individuals making consensual decisions happens to lead to radical breaks with the customs and traditions of culture, so much the worse for that culture. There would be nothing illegitimate about these consequences in Nozick’s view.

Nozick’s arguments for merely a “nightwatchman” state suggest that there is nothing particularly interesting about authority in his political theory except as it allows for security of citizens and their property. However, if authority is used to curtail individual freedoms in order to fit some pre-ordained set of societal norms, Nozick would have been vehemently opposed to such intrusion of the state into private lives. He was opposed to any sort of paternalistic legislation. For example, Nozick would have criticized laws prohibiting or restricting the riding of motorcycles without helmets on the ground that the state should not have the right to interfere with an individual’s choice to risk serious injury from accidents. Furthermore, Nozick opposed what might be called the “legislation of morality.” For instance, he would have thought it wrongful for the state to interfere with homosexual couples who want to marry and wish to exercise property rights and provisions with respect to domestic partnerships.

Yet, even with that said, it is clear why Nozick appeals to those who are classified as part of the right in party politics (especially in the United States). Again, there is some confusion to be cleared up with respect to labels. Nozick’s views are amenable to some conservatives as they are called in party politics (that is, those members of the Republican Party in the United States who call themselves fiscal conservatives). First of all, Nozick thought that we have robust property rights and borrowing from John Locke he endorsed the notion that we own ourselves. As Nozick famously asserts, “Individuals have rights, and there are things no person or group may do to them (without violating their rights)” (Nozick, 1974, ix). Capitalists and/or free market supporters will find this attractive since it means that we can sell our labor to whomever we wish and (more importantly) buy it from whoever will consent. Self-ownership, thought Nozick, means that we own our labor. This also allows for legitimate transfer of goods as we own ourselves and through our actions with other items in the world we justifiably come to own them as well. While Nozick doesn’t use this particular argument, his position is consistent with the capitalist idea that our use and manipulation of properly acquired raw materials also seems to confer value onto these items. Free market advocates endorse much of Locke’s theory of just property acquisition and Nozick, despite recognizing some possible criticisms of this position seems to end up implicitly accepting important components of it.

Furthermore, Nozick’s insistence that one may legitimately transfer her property any way she wishes just so long as no one is coerced or defrauded is very friendly to the views of free market economists. It is significant to note that Nozick thought these transfers to be legitimated without any consideration of whether the recipients deserve the acquisition of goods. While it is true that free market advocates tend to proclaim the idea that entrepreneurs have an additional claim to profits because they deserve them due to effort, contribution to society, and acceptance of risk, they still share with Nozick the fundamental principle that property owners possess absolute property rights. In sum, the implication of robust property rights – that freedom has a great deal to do with what one may do with his or her property without state interference – is a strongly shared notion of Nozick and capitalists.

Another area of agreement between capitalists and Nozick continues the theme of the limited role of governmental action, this time involving a disavowal of redistributive taxation. Nozick thinks individual rights are so strong that his theory will require significant constraints on state action vis-à-vis individuals. For him, the state’s proper purview is protection of persons and their assorted property rights. However, the state is not justified in forced takings of holdings (that is, via taxation) in order to serve the welfare needs of the poor.

In fact, Nozick is both supported (most notably by Edward Feser (2000)) and criticized (most notably by Brian Barry (1975, 332)) for comparing taxation with forced labor. “Taxation of earnings from labor,” argues Nozick, “is on a par with forced labor” (1974, 169).” He adds that “Seizing the results from someone’s labor is equivalent to seizing hours from him and directing him to carry on various activities. If people force you to do certain work, or unrewarded work, for a certain period of time, they decide what you are to do and what purposes your work is to serve apart from your decisions. This process whereby they take this decision from you makes them a part-owner of you; it gives them a property right in you. Just as having such partial control and power of decision, by right, over an animal or inanimate object would be to have a property right in it” (1974, 172).

3. Anarchy, State and Utopia

a. An Invisible Hand Justification of the State

In Anarchy, State and Utopia, Nozick first accepted the task of evaluating of whether government is necessary at all. Notice that Nozick is not merely addressing Rawls in writing Anarchy, State and Utopia. Part of the reason that Nozick became a libertarian was as a result of his discussion while a graduate student with Murray Rothbard. Rothbard not only convinced him of the plausibility of libertarianism, but also of the strength of challenges from anarchists to the idea that any state could be legitimate. Thus, Nozick took anarchist doubts about the legitimacy of the state seriously and thought these concerns needed to be addressed. Additionally, since Nozick commenced with the assertion that individuals have rights, he needed to see if the very notion of a state is compatible with these rights. It is important to note that Nozick believed in Lockean natural rights, and thus he had to show that a legitimate state could arise without the violation of them. What some commentators on Nozick disagree about is why Nozick did not use a social contract type argument (that is, in the tradition of Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau) for how a legitimate state could arise.

Some commentators (most forcefully Ralf Bader) do not believe Nozick avoided using a social contract approach to showing how a state could arise because he somehow worried that such an approach is problematic. On this interpretation, Nozick’s goal was not to show how an actual state came about, but that he simply wanted to give a plausible explanatory account of how a legitimate state could come to be (Bader, 2010, 29-30).  Bader notes that Nozick gives what he calls a fundamental potential explanation. A fundamental potential explanation is, as Nozick put it, “an explanation that would explain the whole realm under consideration were it the actual explanation” (Nozick, 1974, 8). But it would also do so with appealing to the realm itself. What this means is that Nozick tried to give an explanation of the political realm in non-political terms. He went to say that an adequate theory of the state of nature would describe “how a state arises from that state of nature will serve our explanatory purposes, even if no actual state arose in that way” (Nozick, 1974, 7). Since Nozick had this explanatory goal, this is part of the reason why he didn’t use a consent-based approach to showing the formation of the state. Using the consent approach, on this interpretation, would be a trivial case because it doesn’t explain the justification of the state in non-political terms and thus would not qualify as a fundamental potential explanation. Nozick didn’t want to simply show that people could agree to form a state, he wanted to reveal that even without their intention, the actions of people would lead to the establishment of a state.

However, other commentators on Nozick’s work (such as Jeffrey Paul) contend that as a natural rights libertarian, Nozick also knew that any argument he made for the justification of the state could not proceed from the approach that there is a social contract to which individuals would need to consent. There are two reasons for this. First of all, the state created via the social contract monopolizes protective services and thus constrains the property rights of those of succeeding generations who were not involved with the negotiations of the original contract. Secondly, in the social contract approach, the state would transfer the power to tax to the majority, which would bind subsequent generations to that power, and thereby would seem to violate Lockean property rights. On this interpretation, while Nozick still desired to give a fundamental potential explanation, he did so because it fits well in addressing anarchist complaints. For all of these substantive reasons, Paul believes that Nozick needed to take an approach that does not follow from social contract theory (J. Paul, 1981, 68).

No matter which interpretation is endorsed, most agree that in effect Nozick proposed a new solution to the very old problem of political legitimacy. His starting point was still a state of nature (just as it was for Locke, Hobbes and Rousseau), understood as the condition people find themselves in when no political authority exists. Nozick began with the question of whether there are any methods of efficient administration of justice within the state of nature. One of his original contributions to the debate over this question was to offer an account of how such a method could arise. In fact, Nozick thought that the method will inevitably result in the creation of a state despite the fact that no one intends to create one. This is known as an invisible hand justification of the state. Nozick proposed that individuals, simply via their pursuit of improving their own conditions will perform actions that will lead to a minimal state. Again, this result comes without anyone intending to found (or perhaps even conceive of) one. Additionally, and perhaps more importantly, Nozick argued that such a conclusion could be reached without violation of anyone’s property rights.

How did Nozick think he answered the anarchists who insist that no state could be legitimate because such an entity inherently violates individual rights? First, we have to more fully understand how he envisioned the anarchists’ main objection to the justifiable formation of a state. The anarchist objection as Nozick saw it involves the idea that the state by its nature monopolizes coercive power and then proceeds to punish those who violate this monopoly. When this notion is combined with the idea that states provide protection for all within a specific geographical area by coercing some to finance the protection of others, there is a violation of “side constraints” that come in the form of natural rights. Therefore, since these actions are performed by the state, and these actions are immoral, the state is immoral. Of course, anarchists think the criticism goes even deeper than this. They complain that these actions flow from what they see as the main, inherent function of the state, not merely as the result of any particular state that happens to violate the rights of individuals.

How exactly did Nozick think the state arises through his invisible hand approach? We have to imagine that we are in a free market state of nature, where individuals possess natural rights. Generally speaking, these individuals are moral actors. However, if some do not act morally (as some likely won’t on some occasions) we would enter into what Nozick called mutual protection agencies. These agencies sell security packages like a free market economic good that individuals in a state of nature would surely buy for self and property protection.

Mutual protection agencies will eventually develop into dominant protection agencies, which are basically the pre-eminent mutual protection agencies within their respective territories. In turn, dominant protection agencies will ultimately become ultra minimal states. An ultra minimal state is a dominant protection agency where protection is still purchased as an economic good but where the agency also has a monopoly on force in the region. The ultra minimal state will evolve into the minimal state, when in addition to having the two factors of the ultra minimal state also makes a “redistribution” of protection to some independents (non-clients of the ultra minimal state) within its territorial boundaries at the cost of the ultra minimal state’s clients.

Nozick regarded this evolution of protection agencies into states as significant because it would provide a moral justification for state legitimacy. First, he believed he had given an account of the legitimacy for the state using only an invisible hand explanation. Notice that for each step, individuals are voluntarily consenting to arrangements that are not necessarily designed to develop a state. Alternatively, private protection agencies are simply negotiating arrangements between its clients and independents in order to keep the peace. Second, Nozick thought this explanation qualifies as a fundamental potential explanation. That is, the invisible hand explanation explains the formation of the state in a nonpolitical way. In sum, Nozick proposed that the state is justified if it can be explained with a fundamental potential explanation that makes use of an invisible hand explanation without making any morally impermissible steps.

To show how this argument is supposed to run, we need to reflect on the right to self-defense, which in Nozick’s view is presumably a natural right that all have. More specifically, however, everyone has a right to resist if others try to enforce upon them unreliable or unfair procedures of justice. Individuals can elect to transfer this right to the dominant protection agency given that they have purchased the proper protection policy. On these grounds the dominant protection agency thereby can acquire the right to intervene and prohibit independents from trying to exact punishment on their clients. So, in cases where individuals consent to transfer these rights to their dominant protection agency, the dominant protection agency has this right and legitimately monopolizes force. At this point the dominant protection agency in effect becomes an ultra minimal state.

It is significant to notice that Nozick believed that clients of dominant protection agencies presumably do not have to show actual violations of their rights by independents to justify punishment of independents who try to enforce unreliable procedures of justice. In turn, he thought that the dominant protection agency, working on behalf of its clients, could legitimately prohibit independents who use unreliable procedures of justice. This is because when independents try to use unreliable procedures of justice they are effectively risking rights violations. In other words, this riskiness alone is all the justification the dominant protection agency needs in order to prevent independents from punishing their clients.

However, Nozick did realize that this transition from the dominant protection agency to the ultra minimal state places those independents in its territory at a disadvantage. In effect, independents are being prohibited from defending themselves or enforcing their right to punish wrongdoing. It seems that if one is disadvantaged by being prohibited from committing a risky action (that is, is kept from committing the potentially risky activity of applying a procedure of justice that is unreliable) he or she must be compensated for the said disadvantage. This compensation can come in the form of money or “in kind” services. In this case, Nozick thought it would be most feasible for the ultra minimal state to simply offer services instead of money to those disadvantaged by its monopoly of force. At this stage when the ultra minimal state provides protective services to the disadvantaged it thereby transforms into a minimal state.

In order to try to buttress his position for the legitimacy of the minimal state, Nozick provides a second strand of argument. He sets out to explain why, if the client of the ultra minimal state is actually guilty of violating the rights of an independent, the independent still doesn’t have a legitimate case for exacting punishment on the client of the ultra minimal state. After all, everyone else appears to have the right to punish wrongdoers when actual rights violations occur, so why shouldn’t the independent also have this right? In essence, Nozick had to try to justify the dominant protection agency’s prohibition of victims of rights violations by their clients from defending themselves and using their rights of punishment.

Again recall that Nozick thought no one has the right to use an unreliable procedure (or at least one of unproven reliability) to determine whether or not to punish anyone. He contended that it doesn’t matter whether we say a person does not have a right to do something in the absence of appropriate knowledge of wrongdoing or that she has the right but does wrong by using it in the absence of such knowledge. As it turns out, Nozick opts to use the latter expression which allows him to put forth what he calls the Epistemic Principle of Border Crossing. Nozick described this principle as the idea that if someone knows that doing act A would violate Q’s rights unless condition C obtained, he may not do A if he has not ascertained that C obtains through being in the best feasible position for ascertaining this.

Nozick believed that anyone may punish those who violate this principle, just so long as she does not violate the principle herself in the process. With this said, the independent who is being prohibited from exercising punishment ought to be prohibited because she is about to use a procedure that has not been proven reliable. That is, condition C has not been fulfilled and by attempting to exact punishment would be in violation of the Epistemic Principle of Border Crossing. So, in this way, the dominant protection agency is justified in opposing the action of the independent or in punishing the independent if she does carry on punishing its (admittedly guilty) client. Also notice that Nozick tries to deflect the charge from anarchists that granting independents protection regardless of the ability to pay is a form of redistribution of resources and hence a rights violation. Nozick is careful to point out that this action is a form of compensation to independents for effectively disallowing them the right to punish.

b. Individual Rights and the Nature of the Minimal State

As noted earlier, Nozick begins Anarchy, State and Utopia with the assertion that “individuals have rights.” He never defended this proposition, but its intuitive appeal is supposed to be widely shared. Nozick even admitted that he didn’t have a bedrock foundation for individual rights. Once more, he surveyed a number of candidate reasons for why individuals possess rights and found them, taken individually anyhow, to be wanting. He noted that moral agency, free will, and rationality in themselves are not sufficient to ground rights and serve as the moral foundation for his theory. For instance, he explained that the possession of free will, by itself, doesn’t imply that a being ought to act freely.

While Nozick had no structured argument for the notion that individuals possess rights, he did still think that there are reasons in favor of it. He concluded that some combination of the characteristics above constitute something closer to a moral ground for rights. He attempted to ground the intuition that individuals have rights in the idea that each individual has unique value. Only humans have the rational capacity to choose, devise, and pursue projects unlike non-human animals and commodities.

It bears mentioning that what it means to respect people as equals for Nozick draws on the work of Immanuel Kant. Kant thought that we show proper respect for persons when we treat them as ends in themselves. That is, we should treat others as having goals and projects of their own and we mustn’t use them merely as instruments to get what we want. Humans can deliberate about which behaviors will allow them to reach their goals and can only be used in a way that respects that rational capacity. This also means that people cannot be used in any way without their consent.

The individual rights that people possess amount to moral side constraints on what can be done to them. The only condition that could allow for the violations of such side constraints would be if this were the only way to “avoid catastrophic moral horror.” Barring such a dramatic condition, this means that the rights of individuals are not to be ‘traded in’ even if this means gains for the entire society. But why it is so important that individual rights to self and property are not violated could be further explained by the idea that individuals need the space to make their lives meaningful: “I [Nozick] conjecture that the answer [to the question as to what grounds rights] is connected with that elusive and difficult notion: the meaning of life.” Nozick went on to say that the ability of one to shape his life in accordance with some sort of life plan is the very way one brings meaning to his life. This offers another perspective from which we can understand why human life is uniquely valuable. Only beings with the rational capacity to shape their own lives can have or even pursue a meaningful life.

c. Self-Ownership Argument

Nozick attempted to demonstrate the intuition that only free market exchanges respect persons as equals. To do this Nozick developed his “entitlement theory of justice.” To make this clear, we have to start with what might be called his self-ownership argument. Nozick’s self-ownership argument essentially goes like this. 1) People own themselves. This is based on the intuition Nozick supplies above. 2) The world and its objects are originally unowned. 3) One can acquire an absolute right to a disproportionate share of the world if this doesn’t worsen the material condition of others. Furthermore, since Nozick thought each owns herself, each will also own her talents. He reasoned that this also translates into ownership of the products of those talents. The entity that owns and is owned is the same entity, the whole person. With this stipulation, Nozick understood individuals as having absolute property rights over themselves, and once more, absolute property rights over the resources they acquire. 4) It is relatively easy to acquire property rights over a disproportionate amount of the world. 5) Therefore, once private property has been appropriated, a free market in goods and resources is morally required.

d. Separateness of Persons

An important related strand that runs in various ways throughout all of Anarchy, State and Utopia is the “separateness of persons.” As noted earlier, Nozick used Kant as an inspiration and borrowed Kant’s idea that individuals are ends in themselves. But, in order to be different “ends-in-themselves,” Kant observed that people must be separate entities. The idea is the each of us is a distinct individual, each mattering from a moral point of view. This view that individuals, like distinct atoms, are self-contained entities in some ways evokes Hobbes’ metaphysical picture of human existence. An implication of the notion that individuals matter morally is that benefits to some supposed larger entity, such as the “greater society,” cannot be used as a justification for violating individuals as persons. Consider what is often called “the common good.” Nozick challenged the idea that any such entity could really exist. In his view, there are merely individuals, and the common good can only really be the good of these individuals added together. While it is true that some individuals might make sacrifices of some of their interests in order to gain benefits for some other of their interests, society can never be justified in sacrificing the interests of some individuals for the sake of others.

The separateness of persons doctrine is important to Nozick insofar as he thought it supports the existence of moral side-constraints that individuals possess. Moral side constraints set the boundaries for what can permissibly be done to people (whether by other individuals or the state). Violations of such side constraints are wrongful because this treats individuals who suffer the violations merely as means or as instruments to the ends of other people. Notice that these side constraints are supposed to be understood as absolute prohibitions on what can permissibly be done to individuals. That is, even if we thought that violation of the moral side-constraint of just one person could be to the benefit of many others within the society, such a violation could not be justified.

In trying to describe what exactly moral side constraints are perhaps the most obvious prohibition that would follow from them would be any sort of physical aggression. But the very existence of a state seems to suggest coercion of individuals is permissible in some circumstances. As a consequence, Nozick needed to carefully argue that at least one possible function of the state, redistributive taxation, is a form of coercion that is not legitimate for a state to exercise.

e. The Three Principles of Justice

Nozick argued that there are three principles of just distribution. These principles make up the basic framework of his entitlement theory.

The first is the principle of just acquisition. Under this principle, individuals may acquire any property they wish just so long as it is previously unowned and is not taken by theft, coercion or fraud. The second is the principle of just transfer whereby property may be exchanged just so long as the transfer is not executed (again) by theft, force or fraud. These two principles constitute the legitimate means of acquiring and transferring goods. All valid transactions come from repeated actions on these two principles. While Nozick did not explicitly define what is now known as his third principle, he described its function. This third principle – just rectification – works, as the name suggests, to rectify violations of the first two principles.

What actions on these three principles reflect is what Nozick calls a “historical” theory of justice. He thought there was no way, simply by looking at the patterns of distribution that we could tell whether or not these distributions of goods are just. Nozick emphasized that we have to know exactly how the distribution came about. If somewhere in the chain of transactions theft, coercion or fraud occurred, then we could safely say that the property involved is unjustly held. The three principles of just distribution thereby regulate proper property acquisition and exchange.

As alluded to earlier, the entitlement theory of justice does not depend on the concept of just desert (reward) in order to validate the acquisition or transfer of property. For example, consider the principle of just transfer. One implication of this principle is that inheritance is perfectly legitimate. It is irrelevant from the perspective of the entitlement theory that the scions of billionaires may not have worked hard or contributed in any way to their parents’ fortunes. Moreover, it is not germane to the entitlement theorist that the benefactor of the inheritance is morally upstanding or somehow has made great contributions to society. Finally, it doesn’t matter that the scion’s being a part of billionaire family is morally arbitrary – that there is no sense of thinking that he is somehow undeserving of inheritance because he didn’t “make his way” into the family . If the billionaire wishes to gift the family fortune to the ne’er-do-well son, the son is entitled to that inheritance. The idea that just holdings for Nozick are not dependent on desert is an important consideration given that many free market advocates have tried to justify accumulation of enormous amounts of wealth based on the desert of those acquiring it. Common notions of desert appeal to the concepts of effort, innovation, contribution or merit in attempting to justify why some should have more than others. But Nozick saw the strained arguments used for the justification of property holdings on the basis of desert. For Nozick, desert is beside the point. But more importantly, desert theory cannot be justified as the basis for the justification of property holdings on his view because it is a patterned theory (more on this below).

The state then can be seen as an institution that serves to protect private property rights and the transactions that follow from them regardless of our thoughts of some people deserving more or less than they have. This function is fulfilled via preservation of the three principles of distribution. This means that the state functions to secure individuals’ safety and their goods, which presumably could be threatened by forces within or from outside of one’s territory. For security within the state, this necessitates a civil police force. For security from threats outside of the territory, the need is for a standing army. Provisions for these functions are legitimate concerns of the Nozickian state. In addition, given the third principle of distributive justice in Nozick’s scheme, there will need to be a judiciary. This is due to the practical matter that there will likely be disagreements over the status of contracts, whether they have been enacted properly, and whether allegations of personal or property rights violations have occurred. Somebody needs to adjudicate these conflicts, and the most effective means (according to Nozick) is through tort law proceedings. Also, the courts are to function in perhaps a more obvious way given the principle of rectification – to ensure that holdings are restored to their rightful owners in cases where justice in acquisition and justice in transfer principles are violated. An implication of all of this is that the state is within its right to demand tax monies to support these functions.

f. The Wilt Chamberlain and "Sunset/Yacht Lover" Examples

Nozick devises an imaginative example using an actual former professional basketball player (Wilt Chamberlain) to criticize what he calls “patterned” theories of justice. Patterned theories of justice are those whereby the distribution of holdings is considered to be just when there is some purpose or goal reached. For example, radical egalitarians argue that the most just distribution of goods and resources is one in which these items are equally shared across a society. Utilitarianism is another example of a patterned theory since all goods are justly distributed when they maximize the overall good of a society. Finally, John Rawls’ theory of justice would be considered to be a patterned theory because goods may only be distributed in the case that transfers benefit the least well-off members of society. What all of these theories share is that distributions of goods will only be declared just when they conform to a pattern stipulated by a favored principle of justice.

To argue against patterned theories of just distribution, Nozick wanted to show that patterns can only be imposed by either disallowing acts that disrupt the pattern (or as Nozick puts it, to “forbid capitalist acts between two adults”) or to constantly redistribute goods in order to reset the pattern. Nozick tried to demonstrate the truth of two propositions. The first is that if individuals have acquired their holdings justly, then the free exchange of them with others (provided no theft, fraud or coercion are involved) are just. The second proposition is supposed to result from the first. It holds that free exchanges will always conclude in disrupting alleged patterns of just distribution. But it seems that if we have ownership of property legitimately, we can dispose of it in any way we wish no matter what distribution of goods results. Nozick certainly realized that allowing individuals to exchange their goods without any patterning principle would lead to extreme inequalities of resources. However, he thought any measures to “correct” for such inequalities by governmental intervention would be unjust.

In the Wilt Chamberlain example, Nozick has us imagine a society that has the reader’s favorite distribution of resources. For the sake of argument, we’ll say that there are one million and one members and all have equal shares – we’ll call this distribution D1. We are also to imagine that Wilt signs a contract with a team with the stipulation that for each home game he gets 25 cents from the price of every ticket sold. As the season goes on, imagine that each person in the society gladly contributes 25 cents to see Wilt perform. After a million fans come to see him play, he has made $250,000. Therefore, there will be a new distribution, D2, in which Wilt has his original resources plus $250,000. Excluding all other transactions, we can assume that all others in society have much less than Wilt. Nozick asks if there is anything unjust about this example and if there is anything unjust, what could be the reason? Since each person agreed to D1, each person should be entitled to his or her share. This also means that each individual may choose to do with his resources what he likes and many have decided to give some to Wilt. Obviously D1 and D2 are not the same. However, D2 came from what we agreed was a just distribution plus a number of free exchanges. So, D2 is just, but D2 violates the pattern in D1 in which each is supposed to remain on the same level of resources.

Nozick’s first point is that allowing individuals the liberty to exchange their goods as they wish, given that they have fully consented to the transfers will clearly (and continually) disrupt the pattern of holdings. Notice that if you agree with Nozick that no injustice is done in the steps of forming the new set of holdings in D2, there is nothing unjust about D2. But what if one wants to re-establish D1? Notice what Nozick thinks would have to happen in this case. In order to realign the pattern of holdings, some entity (most likely the state) would need to intervene. That is, if D1 was that all had equal holdings and now at D2 we realize we want to revert to D1, we would have to take a portion of the holdings from those who have more to give to those who have less. But, here is the problem: What if those who have greater holdings in D2 do not want to give up their holdings, protesting that they had acquired them justly? If the state takes a portion of holdings away, how is this different from Robin Hood doing the same thing? Isn’t this merely a form of theft?

With the Wilt Chamberlain example in place, this provided Nozick with the opportunity to bolster his argument against patterned theories. He emphasized the point that preserving patterns will often necessitate redistributing goods through taxation from those who have to those who have not and that this is not an innocuous result. In effect, this redistribution results in forced labor. After all, Nozick pointed out, what do taxes represent? Certainly, money is taken, but Nozick argued that “seizing the results of someone’s labor is equivalent to seizing hours from him and directing him to carry on various activities.” In essence, Nozick thought that this is tantamount to forcing someone to work for an amount of time for proposes he has not chosen. Patterned principles in effect give some people a claim to the labor of other people. Nozick believed this translates into a transgression of self-ownership as the enforceable claim of some on the labor of others amounts to the partial ownership of some people by others.

There is another problem here as well. Nozick also worried that the degree of interference in peoples’ lives will vary depending on their different chosen lifestyles in a way that is discriminatory against certain people. He wondered why people shouldn’t have the right to choose their own lifestyles provided that they are not making others worse off than they would have been in a state of nature? Nozick objected that individuals who have more materialistic interests are required to work longer hours than those with more aesthetic lifestyles. He questioned why the person who wishes to “see a movie” must be required (since he must earn money for the movie ticket) to provide “money for the needy” while those who prefer to look at sunsets (who don’t need to earn money to enjoy them) do not? The point Nozick was trying to make is that if owning a luxury yacht is what makes me happy, I will have to work much longer than someone who simply likes sunsets. The person who likes sunsets doesn’t need money to enjoy them – he can pursue his happiness and meet his tax obligations to the state with limited labor time. However, I may need to work six extra months to have enough to purchase the yacht and meet my tax obligations to the state. Not only do I need the principle amount of money for the purchase, I am also taxed to provide for social programs. In this scenario, Nozick wonders why the yacht lover, simply because of his lifestyle, has to work six months to acquire what he wants and pay his taxes, as opposed to the sunset lover, who needs to work much less to achieve these same ends.

g. The Experience Machine

While the Wilt Chamberlain and sunset/yacht lover examples may take aim at any sort of patterned theory (though it was most likely targeted at Rawls’ theory of justice), Nozick uses yet another creative example to argue against classical utilitarianism. He has us imagine a machine developed by “super duper neuropsychologists” into which one could enter and have any sort of experience she desires. A person’s brain could be stimulated so she would think and feel that she was reading a book, writing a great novel, or climbing Mt.Everest. But all of the time the person would simply be floating in a tank with electrodes attached to her head. If one worries that she would get bored by a life of pleasant circumstances, there is nothing that disallows her from simply having problematic events programmed in to keep things interesting. As this is a thought experiment, and Nozick doesn’t want readers to be distracted by details that don’t force them to test their intuitions, we are to imagine that the machine is reliable, in fact unbreakable, so these would not be technical or trivial reasons to fail to enter. Nozick asks the reader if she would enter the machine.

Nozick thought we would not enter, concluding that people would follow his intuition that such programmed experiences are not real. He argued that people don’t merely want to experience certain actions, but that they want to actually do them. Nozick suspects that we wouldn’t enter the machine because we don’t merely wish to experience being famous, but we want to be certain types of people who do certain types of thing. For example, I don’t merely want to experience that I am a great novelist, I want to genuinely be a great novelist.

In what way is the intuition we are supposed to gain from the experience machine a criticism of classical utilitarianism? The idea is the fundamental value underlying utilitarianism as classically described by Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill is that happiness is the highest and only intrinsic good. That is, happiness is the good for whose sake all other goods are pursued. Presumably the initial allure of entering into Nozick’s machine would be the promise of acquiring pleasure. However, the unwillingness to ultimately enter seems to signify that we want something else beyond happiness in our lives, whether that is reality or genuineness. Hence, it appears that happiness is not the highest good. Though this appears to strike a significant blow against classical utilitarianism, it doesn’t seem to affect other forms of utilitarianism such as preference utilitarianism. Preference utilitarians could claim that people might not go into the machine not because they care about values other than happiness more, but because they prefer to experience happiness only via some means that involve actively pursuing happiness and not merely experiencing it. Furthermore, they might see happiness in a complex way whereby they don’t merely desire “brute” pleasure, but want a nuanced sort of happiness.

h. The Lockean Proviso

Are there any limits to how many more resources some may own over others assuming that the distribution of holdings came about in a just way, even on Nozick’s view? There is one (albeit loose) constraint – the Lockean Proviso. While Nozick did not accept the entire Lockean theory of property, he does utilize components of it and retrofits them for his own use in his theory of entitlement. One of the famous constraints on property accumulation from Locke; is that one may own property just so long as he has left “enough and as good” for others. This prevents the monopolization of goods that are necessary for life. For instance, owning the only remaining water well would not be permitted under the terms of the proviso.

However, Nozick re-interprets the proviso to mean that if the initial acquisition fails to make anyone worse off who was using the resource before, then it is justly acquired. That is, in Nozick’s interpretation of the proviso, the position of others after the acquisition cannot be made worse off than they were when the property in question was unowned. Of course, this rendering of the proviso means that someone could appropriate all of a good, just so long as they allowed access to it to those who were using the resource before and that this appropriation does not make them worse off materially than they were before. This alternative rendering of the Lockean proviso leaves only an extremely limited constraint on the accumulation of resources. Hence, it would seem that even with the amended Lockean proviso adding some qualification to the acquisition of resources, Nozick’s entitlement theory would still allow for rather dramatic inequality of holdings throughout a libertarian society.

i. Utopia

The third and final part of Anarchy, State and Utopia deals with the topic of utopia and is generally thought to be the section of the book that receives the least amount of attention. Many scholars have noted that this section seems to serve as Nozick’s attempt to make what seems to be a very bleak picture of property rights (in which the poor are left being aided only by the discretion of private benefactors) into a potentially inspiring political model. But a second purpose of this section is likely to provide an independent argument for the minimal state.

Nozick begins the section by noting that we could use two different methods for figuring out what is the best sort of society to live in. One method he calls a “design” method and the other he dubs a “filter” method. By a design method Nozick had in mind the idea of people brainstorming about what the best sort of society might be (for example, Rawls’ method in A Theory of Justice). Then, the group could pattern a single society based on the desiderata arising from these deliberations. However, Nozick was skeptical about the viability of this model to yield successful results. He didn’t think that it is possible for there to be just one best form of society for everyone. Human beings are complex, with lots of different ideas about what traits would adhere to the best possible world. To make this point, Nozick has us imagine a bevy of different historical figures (including Beethoven, Wittgenstein, Henry Ford, Thoreau, Elizabeth Taylor, and Moses). Nozick challenges us to consider whether there could really be any one ideal world for all of these very different individuals. In the least, Nozick says that it is highly unlikely that even if there were one ideal society for all, that it could be determined in “an a priori fashion.”

Instead, he turns to the possibility of using a filtering device and promotes the idea of a sort of meta-utopia. In this filtering method, people consider many different societies and critique them, eliminating some and modifying others. In this process, we can imagine people trying out societies as a sort of experiment, leaving those they find hopeless or altering those they could find acceptable with some tinkering. As we might expect, some communities will simply be abandoned, others will flourish, and some will continue on but not without struggles. So, this meta-utopia would serve as a framework or platform for many diverse experimental communities. These would all be formed as voluntary communities, whereby no one would have the right to impose one utopian vision on the others. This effectively disallows “imperialistic” communities that may take as their mission to gain control of other communities for its own expansion. Some commentators have likened this anti-imperialistic clause in Nozick’s framework of utopia to a version of cultural relativism.

The point of Nozick’s framework for utopia is that consenting citizens could band together into political subunits and voluntarily select from any number of different societies to join. For example, those sympathetic with trade unionists could elect to develop a community where ownership groups consisted only of workers. In fact, Nozick was surprised that this sort of arrangement had not already evolved from vocal members of the political left who argue that the only just notion of property is one held by all in a classless society. A different subgroup which collectively decides that a strong welfare safety net is essential could vote to tax themselves at a high level in order to redistribute goods to help out the least fortunate via extensive rights to health care, child care, unemployment assistance, and so forth.

Nozick thought that following his political principles could lead to a vast array of different political entrepreneurships. All that is required is that one (or many) recruit fellow members to join into an association of likeminded citizens who all voluntarily agree to follow the stipulations of their new community. Notice that there is no violation of rights here. Just so long as all agree to the rules of the group, they could agree to form a society that looks much like the social democracies of Scandinavia. Likewise, it seems possible that individuals could join to form quite illiberal communities. The minimal requirements involve the idea that no one can be forced or deceived into joining. Additionally, if one is disenchanted with his/her current political association, he or she must have a right to exit.

Some commentators have thought that for the sake of clarity, it would be best to think of Nozick’s utopian vision here in a federalist fashion. The minimal state would serve as a replacement for the federal government. Smaller political entities, such as states or provinces could be developed which would consist of groups of citizens who voluntarily (but unanimously) agree to their own separate sets of political ideals. Additionally, reflecting on the best method for allowing individuals to achieve their own utopian aspirations leads us to a separate argument for the minimal state. For if we agree with Nozick that the filtering method is the best way for individuals to realize their utopian dreams, they should endorse his conception of a minimal state. After all, what is the framework for utopia but a minimal state? Notice that in the final section of Anarchy State and Utopia, the minimal state is not justified on the grounds of individual rights. Instead, the minimal state here provides a political framework that respects diversity and allows different individuals to pursue their own conceptions of the good. Nozick thinks that this should be considered as a major advantage to endorsing libertarian principles as a platform or framework for political organization.

4. Later Thought on Libertarianism

Famously, Nozick largely abandons work in political philosophy after the publication of Anarchy, State and Utopia. He mentions in Socratic Puzzles that he had no interest in defending his libertarian views in political theory from its critics by writing “Son of Anarchy, State and Utopia” or “Return of the Son of Anarchy.” However, in The Examined Life, Nozick did indicate that he had strayed away from libertarianism. On the other hand, the details for this turn are thin and somewhat mysterious. Nozick said that he did not mean to work out his own alternative to libertarianism later in life and only points out what he viewed as a major failure of the theory

He notes that libertarianism is seriously inadequate, partially because the theory does not “fully knit the humane considerations and joint cooperative activities it left room for more closely into its fabric” (that is, a communitarian or Aristotelian analysis). Apparently he also thought that somehow the theory did not take into account sufficiently the “symbolic” importance of some collective actions. He acknowledges that there are some goals citizens wish to achieve through the means of government as an expression of our human solidarity and perhaps of human respect in itself. Some commentators have noted that we shouldn’t interpret these reservations as a wholesale abdication of libertarianism. In an interview late in his life Nozick explained that his turn away from libertarianism was largely exaggerated, adding that he still endorsed the theory but was no longer a “hard core” follower.

5. References and Future Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Nozick, Robert. Anarchy, State and Utopia. New York: Basic Books, 1974.
  • Nozick, Philosophical Explanations. Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press, 1981.
  • Nozick, Robert. Socratic Puzzles. Cambridge, MA: HarvardUniversity Press, 1997.
  • Nozick, Robert. The Examined Life. New York: Simon and Schuster, 1989.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Althan, J.E.J. Review of Anarchy, State and Utopia. Philosophy. Vol. 52, no. 199 (1977), pp. 102-105.
  • Bader, Ralf. Robert Nozick. London, Continuum Press, 2010.
  • Bakaya, Santosh. The Political Theory of Robert Nozick. Delhi, India: Gyan Books, 2006.
  • Barry, Brian. Review of Anarchy, State and Utopia by Robert Nozick. Political Theory, Vol. 3, No. 3 (1975), pp. 331-336.
  • Brighouse, Harry. Justice. Cambridge, U.K.: Polity Press, 2004.
  • Cohen, G.A. Self-Ownership, Freedom, and Equality. (Cambridge, U.K.: CambridgeUniversity Press, 1995.
  • Exdell, John. Distributive Justice: Nozick on Property Rights. Ethics, Vol. 87, No. 2 (1977), pp. 142-149.
  • Feser, Edward. Taxation, Forced Labor, and Theft. The Independent Review, Vol. 2, No. 2 (2000), pp. 219-235.
  • Fried, Barbara. Wilt Chamberlain Revisited: Nozick’s ‘Justice in Transfer’ and the Problem of Market-Based Distribution. Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 24, No. 3 (1995), pp. 226-245.
  • Hailwood, Simon A. Exploring Nozick. Aldershot, UK: Avebury, 1996.
  • Holmes, Robert. Nozick on Anarchism. Political Theory, Vol. 5, No.2 (1977), pp. 247-256.
  • Lacey, A.R. Robert Nozick. Princeton, NJ: PrincetonUniversity Press, 2001.
  • Litan, Robert. On Rectification in Nozick’s Minimal State. Political Theory, Vol. 5, no. 2 (1977), pp. 233-246.
  • Kearl, J.R. Do Entitlements Imply that Taxation is Theft? Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 7, no. 1 (1977), pp. 74-81.
  • Kymlicka, Will. Contemporary Political Philosophy. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1990.
  • Machan, Tibor. Some Recent Work in Human Rights Theory. American Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 17, No. 2 (1980), pp. 103-115.
  • Murray, Dale. Nozick, Autonomy and Compensation. London: Continuum Press, 2007.
  • Otsuka, Michael. Self-Ownership and Equality: A Lockean Reconciliation. Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 27, no.1 (1998), pp. 65-92.
  • Paul, Ellen Frankel. Natural Rights Liberalism from Locke to Nozick. Cambridge, UK: CambridgeUniversity Press, 2005.
  • Paul, Jeffrey. Reading Nozick. Totawa, NJ: Rowman & Littlefield, 1981.
  • Rigterink, Roger. Robert Nozick: Anarchy, State and Utopia. (Unpublished essay, 2007).
  • Sandel, Michael. Liberalism and its Critics. New York: New YorkUniversity Press, 1984.
  • Scanlon, Thomas. Nozick on Rights, Liberty, and Property. Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 6, No. 1 (1976), pp. 3-25.
  • Schmidtz, David. Robert Nozick. Cambridge: CambridgeUniversity Press, 2002.
  • Sterba, James. Recent Work on Alternative Conceptions of Justice. American Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 23, No. 1 (1986), pp. 1-22.
  • Wolff, Jonathan. Robert Nozick: Property, Justice, and the Minimal State. Stanford, CA: StanfordUniversity Press, 1991.

Author Information

Dale Murray
University of Wisconsin-Baraboo/Sauk County
University of Wisconsin-Richland
U. S. A.

Michel Foucault: Political Thought

The work of twentieth-century French philosopher Michel Foucault has increasingly influenced the study of politics. This influence has mainly been via concepts he developed in particular historical studies that have been taken up as analytical tools; “governmentality” and ”biopower” are the most prominent of these. More broadly, Foucault developed a radical new conception of social power as forming strategies embodying intentions of their own, above those of individuals engaged in them; individuals for Foucault are as much products of as participants in games of power.

The question of Foucault’s overall political stance remains hotly contested. Scholars disagree both on the level of consistency of his position over his career, and the particular position he could be said to have taken at any particular time. This dispute is common both to scholars critical of Foucault and to those who are sympathetic to his thought.

What can be generally agreed about Foucault is that he had a radically new approach to political questions, and that novel accounts of power and subjectivity were at its heart. Critics dispute not so much the novelty of his views as their coherence. Some critics see Foucault as effectively belonging to the political right because of his rejection of traditional left-liberal conceptions of freedom and justice. Some of his defenders, by contrast, argue for compatibility between Foucault and liberalism. Other defenders see him either as a left-wing revolutionary thinker, or as going beyond traditional political categories.

To summarize Foucault’s thought from an objective point of view, his political works would all seem to have two things in common: (1) an historical perspective, studying social phenomena in historical contexts, focusing on the way they have changed throughout history; (2) a discursive methodology, with the study of texts, particularly academic texts, being the raw material for his inquiries. As such the general political import of Foucault’s thought across its various turns is to understand how the historical formation of discourses have shaped the political thinking and political institutions we have today.

Foucault’s thought was overtly political during one phase of his career, coinciding exactly with the decade of the 1970s, and corresponding to a methodology he designated “genealogy”. It is during this period that, alongside the study of discourses, he analysed power as such in its historical permutations. Most of this article is devoted to this period of Foucault’s work. Prior to this, during the 1960s, the political content of his thought was relatively muted, and the political implications of that thought are contested. So, this article is divided into thematic sections arranged in order of the chronology of their appearance in Foucault’s thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Foucault’s Early Marxism
  2. Archaeology
  3. Genealogy
  4. Discipline
  5. Sexuality
  6. Power
  7. Biopower
  8. Governmentality
  9. Ethics
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary
    2. Secondary

1. Foucault’s Early Marxism

Foucault began his career as a Marxist, having been influenced by his mentor, the Marxist philosopher Louis Althusser, as a student to join the French Communist Party. Though his membership was tenuous and brief, Foucault’s later political thought should be understood against this background, as a thought that is both under the influence of, and intended as a reaction to, Marxism.

Foucault himself tells us that after his early experience of a Stalinist communist party, he felt sick of politics, and shied away from political involvements for a long time. Still, in his first book, which appeared in 1954, less than two years after Foucault had left the Party, his theoretical perspective remained Marxist. This book was a history of psychology, published in English as Mental Illness and Psychology. In the original text, Foucault concludes that mental illness is a result of alienation caused by capitalism. However, he excised this Marxist content from a later edition in 1962, before suppressing publication of the book entirely; an English translation of the 1962 edition continues to be available only by an accident of copyright (MIP vii). Thus, one can see a trajectory of Foucault’s decisively away from Marxism and indeed tendentially away from politics.

2. Archaeology

Foucault’s first major, canonical work was his 1961 doctoral dissertation, The History of Madness. He gives here a historical account, repeated in brief in the 1962 edition of Mental Illness and Psychology, of what he calls the constitution of an experience of madness in Europe, from the fifteenth to the nineteenth centuries. This encompasses correlative study of institutional and discursive changes in the treatment of the mad, to understand the way that madness was constituted as a phenomenon. The History of Madness is Foucault’s longest book by some margin, and contains a wealth of material that he expands on in various ways in much of his work of the following two decades. Its historical inquiry into the interrelation of institutions and discourses set the pattern for his political works of the 1970s.

Foucault saw there as being three major shifts in the treatment of madness in the period under discussion. The first, with the Renaissance, saw a new respect for madness. Previously, madness had been seen as an alien force to be expelled, but now madness was seen as a form of wisdom. This abruptly changed with the beginning of the Enlightenment in the seventeenth century. Now rationality was valorized above all else, and its opposite, madness, was excluded completely. The unreasonable was excluded from discourse, and congenitally unreasonable people were physically removed from society and confined in asylums. This lasted until the end of the eighteenth century, when a new movement “liberating” the mad arose. For Foucault, however, this was no true liberation, but rather the attempt by Enlightenment reasoning to finally negate madness by understanding it completely, and cure it with medicine.

The History of Madness thus takes seriously the connection between philosophical discourse and political reality. Ideas about reason are not merely taken to be abstract concerns, but as having very real social implications, affecting every facet of the lives of thousands upon thousands of people who were considered mad, and indeed, thereby, altering the structure of society. Such a perspective represents a change in respect of Foucault’s former Marxism. Rather than attempt to ground experience in material circumstances, here it might seem that cultural transformation is being blamed for the transformation of society. That is, it might seem that Foucault had embraced idealism, the position that ideas are the motor force of history, Marxism’s opposite. This would, however, be a misreading. The History of Madness posits no causal priority, either of the cultural shift over the institutional, or vice versa. It simply notes the coincident transformation, without etiological speculation. Moreover, while the political forces at work in the history of madness were not examined by Foucault in this work, it is clearly a political book, exploring the political stakes of philosophy and medicine.

Many were convinced that Foucault was an idealist, however, by later developments in his thought. After The History of Madness, Foucault began to focus on the discursive, bracketing political concerns almost entirely. This was first, and most clearly, signalled in the preface to his next book, The Birth of the Clinic. Although the book itself essentially extends The History of Madness chronologically and thematically, by examining the birth of institutional medicine from the end of the eighteenth century, the preface is a manifesto for a new methodology that will attend only to discourses themselves, to the language that is uttered, rather than the institutional context. It is the following book in Foucault’s sequence, rather than The Birth of the Clinic itself, that carried this intention to fulfilment: this book was The Order of Things (1966). Whereas in The History of Madness and The Birth of the Clinic, Foucault had pursued historical researches that had been relatively balanced between studying conventional historical events, institutional change, and the history of ideas, The Order of Things represented an abstract history of thought that ignored almost anything outside the discursive. This method was in effect what was at that time in France called “structuralism,” though Foucault was never happy with this use of this term. His specific claims were indeed quite unique, namely that in the history of academic discourses, in a given epoch, knowledge is organized by an episteme, which governs what kind of statements can be taken as true. The Order of Things charts several successive historical shifts of episteme in relation to the human sciences.

These claims led Foucault onto a collision with French Marxism. This could not have been entirely unintended by Foucault, in particular because in the book he specifically accuses Marxism of being a creature of the nineteenth century that was now obsolete. He also concluded the work by indicating his opposition to humanism, declaring that “man” (the gendered “man” here refers to a concept that in English we have come increasingly to call the “human”) as such was perhaps nearing obsolescence. Foucault here was opposing a particular conception of the human being as a sovereign subject who can understand itself. Such humanism was at that time the orthodoxy in French Marxism and philosophy, championed the pre-eminent philosopher of the day, Jean-Paul Sartre, and upheld by the French Communist Party’s central committee explicitly against Althusser just a month before The Order of Things was published (DE1 36). In its humanist form, Marxism cast itself as a movement for the full realization of the individual. Foucault, by contrast, saw the notion of the individual as a recent and aberrant idea. Furthermore, his entire presumption to analyse and criticize discourses without reference to the social and economic system that produced them seemed to Marxists to be a massive step backwards in analysis. The book indeed seems to be apolitical: it refuses to take a normative position about truth, and accords no importance to anything outside abstract, academic discourses. The Order of Things proved so controversial, its claims so striking, that it became a best-seller in France, despite being a lengthy, ponderous, scholarly tome.

Yet, Foucault’s position is not quite as anti-political as has been imagined. The explicit criticism of Marxism in the book was specifically of Marx’s economic doctrine: it amounts to the claim that this economics is essentially a form of nineteenth century political economy. It is thus not a total rejection of Marxism, or dismissal of the importance of economics. His anti-humanist position was not in itself anti-Marxist, inasmuch as Althusser took much the same line within a Marxist framework, albeit one that tended to challenge basic tenets of Marxism, and which was rejected by the Marxist establishment. This shows it is possible to use the criticism of the category of “man” in a pointedly political way. Lastly, the point of Foucault’s “archaeological” method of investigation, as he now called it, of looking at transformations of discourses in their own terms without reference to the extra-discursive, does not imply in itself that discursive transformations can be explained without reference to anything non-discursive, only that they can be mapped without any such reference. Foucault thus shows a lack of interest in the political, but no outright denial of the importance of politics.

Foucault was at this time fundamentally oriented towards the study of language. This should not in itself be construed as apolitical. There was a widespread intellectual tendency in France during the 1960s to focus on avant-garde literature as being the main repository for radical hopes, eclipsing a traditional emphasis on the politics of the working class. Foucault wrote widely during this period on art and literature, publishing a book on the obscure French author Raymond Roussel, which appeared on the same day as The Birth of the Clinic. Given Roussel’s eccentricity, this was not far from his reflections on literature in The History of Madness. For Foucault, modern art and literature are essentially transgressive. Transgression is something of a common thread running through Foucault’s work in the 1960s: the transgression of madness and literary modernism is for Foucault directly implicated in the challenge he sees emerging to the current episteme. This interest in literature culminated in what is perhaps Foucault’s best known piece in this relation, ”What Is an Author?”, which combines some of the themes from his final book of the sixties, The Archaeology of Knowledge, with reflections on modern literature in challenging the notion of the human “author” of a work in whatever genre. All of these works, no matter how abstract, can be seen as having important political-cultural stakes for Foucault. Challenging the suzerainty of “man” can in itself be said to have constituted his political project during this period, such was the importance he accorded to discourses. The practical importance of such questions can be seen in The History of Madness.

Foucault was ultimately dissatisfied with this approach, however. The Archaeology of Knowledge, a reflective consideration of the methodology of archaeology itself, ends with an extraordinary self-critical dialogue, in which Foucault answers imagined objections to this methodology.

3. Genealogy

Foucault wrote The Archaeology of Knowledge while based in Tunisia, where he had taken a three-year university appointment in 1966. While the book was in its final stages, the world around him changed. Tunisia went through a political upheaval, with demonstrations against the government, involving many of his students. He was drawn into supporting them, and was persecuted as a result. Much better known and more significant student demonstrations occurred in Paris shortly afterwards, in May of 1968. Foucault largely missed these because he was in Tunis, but he followed news of them keenly.

He returned to France permanently in 1969. He was made the head of the philosophy department at a brand new university at Vincennes. The milieu he found on his return to France was itself highly politicized, in stark contrast to the relatively staid country he had left behind three years before. He was surrounded by peers who had become committed militants, not least his partner Daniel Defert, and including almost all of the colleagues he had hired to his department. He now threw himself into an activism that would characterize his life from that point on.

It was not long before a new direction appeared in his thought to match. The occasion this first became apparent was his 1970 inaugural address for another new job, his second in as many years, this time as a professor at the Collège de France, the highest academic institution in France. This address was published as a book in France, L’ordre du discours, “The Order of Discourse” (which is one of the multiple titles under which it has been translated in English). For the first time, Foucault sets out an explicit agenda of studying institutions alongside discourse. He had done this in the early 1960s, but now he proposed it as a deliberate method, which he called “genealogy.” Much of “The Order of Discourse” in effect recapitulates Foucault’s thought up to that point, the considerations of the history of madness and the regimes of truth that have governed scientific discourse, leading to a sketch of a mode of analysing discourse similar to that of The Archeology of Knowledge. In the final pages, however, Foucault states that he will now undertake analyses in two different directions, critical and “genealogical.” The critical direction consists in the study of the historical formation of systems of exclusion. This is clearly a turn back to the considerations of The History of Madness. The genealogical direction is more novel – not only within Foucault’s work, but in Western thought in general, though the use of the term “genealogical” does indicate a debt to one who came before him, namely Friedrich Nietzsche. The genealogical inquiry asks about the reciprocal relationship between systems of exclusion and the formation of discourses. The point here is that exclusion is not a fate that befalls innocent, pre-existing discourses. Rather, discourses only ever come about within and because of systems of exclusion, the negative moment of exclusion co-existing with the positive moment of the production of discourse. Now, discourse becomes a political question in a full sense for Foucault, as something that is intertwined with power.

“Power” is barely named as such by Foucault in this text, but it becomes the dominant concept of his output of the 1970s. This output comprises two major books, eight annual lecture series he gave at the Collège de France, and a plethora of shorter pieces and interviews. The signature concept of genealogy, combining the new focus on power with the older one on discourse, is his notion of “power-knowledge.” Foucault now sees power and knowledge as indissolubly joined, such that one never has either one without the other, with neither having causal suzerainty over the other.

His first lecture series at the Collège de France, now published in French as Leçons sur la volonté de savoir (“Lessons on the will to knowledge”), extends the concerns of “The Order of Discourse” with the production of knowledge. More overtly political material followed in the next two lecture series, between 1971 and 1973, both of which dealt with the prison system, and led up to Foucault’s first full-scale, published genealogy, 1975’s Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison.

4. Discipline

This research on prisons began in activism. The French state had banned several radical leftist groups in the aftermath of May 1968, and thousands of their members ended up in prisons, where they began to agitate for political rights for themselves, then began to agitate for rights for prisoners in general, having been exposed by their incarceration to ordinary prisoners and their problems. Foucault was the main organizer of a group formed outside the prison, in effect as an outgrowth of this struggle, the Groupe d’informations sur les prisons (the GIP – the Prisons Information Group). This group, composed primarily of intellectuals, sought simply to empower prisoners to speak of their experiences on their own account, by sending surveys out to them and collating their responses.

In tandem with this effort, Foucault researched the history of the prisons, aiming to find out something that the prisoners themselves could not tell him: how the prison system had come into being and what purpose it served in the broader social context. His history of the prisons turns out to be a history of a type of power that Foucault calls “disciplinary,” which encompasses the modern prison system, but is much broader. Discipline and Punish thus comprises two main historical theses. One, specifically pertaining to the prison system, is that this system regularly produces an empirically well-known effect, a layer of specialized criminal recidivists. This is for Foucault simply what prisons objectively do. Pointing this out undercuts the pervasive rationale of imprisonment that prisons are there to reduce crime by punishing and rehabilitating inmates. Foucault considers the obvious objection to this that prisons only produce such effects because they have been run ineffectively throughout their history, that better psychological management of rehabilitation is required, in particular. He answers this by pointing out that such discourses of prison reform have accompanied the prison system since it was first established, and are hence part of its functioning, indeed propping it up in spite of its failures by providing a constant excuse for its failings by arguing that it can be made to work differently.

Foucault’s broader thesis in Discipline and Punish is that we are living in a disciplinary society, of which the prison is merely a potent example. Discipline began not with the prisons, but originally in monastic institutions, spreading out through society via the establishment of professional armies, which required dressage, the training of individual soldiers in their movements so that they could coordinate with one another with precision. This, crucially, was a matter of producing what Foucault calls “docile bodies,” the basic unit of disciplinary power. The prison is just one of a raft of broadly similar disciplinary institutions that come into existence later. Schools, hospitals, and factories all combine similar methods to prisons for arranging bodies regularly in space, down to their minute movements. All combine moreover similar functions. Like the prison, they all have educational, economically productive, and medical aspects to them. The differences between these institutions is a matter of which aspect has primacy.

All disciplinary institutions also do something else that is quite novel, for Foucault: they produce a “soul” on the basis of the body, in order to imprison the body. This eccentric formulation of Foucault’s is meant to capture the way that disciplinary power has increasingly individualized people. Discipline and Punish begins with a vivid depiction of an earlier form of power in France, specifically the execution in 1757 of a man who had attempted to kill the King of France. As was the custom, for this, the most heinous of crimes in a political system focused on the person of the king, the most severe punishment was meted out: the culprit was publicly tortured to death. Foucault contrasts this with the routinized imprisonment that became the primary form of punishing criminals in the 19th century. From a form of power that punished by extraordinary and exemplary physical harm against a few transgressors, Western societies adopted a form of power that attempted to capture all individual behaviour. This is illustrated by a particular example that has become one of the best known images from Foucault’s work, the influential scheme of nineteenth century philosopher Jeremy Bentham called the “Panopticon,” a prison in which every action of the inmates would be visible. This serves as something of a paradigm for the disciplinary imperative, though it was never realized completely in practice.

Systems of monitoring and control nevertheless spread through all social institutions: schools, workplaces, and the family. While criminals had in a sense already been punished individually, they were not treated as individuals in the full sense that now developed. Disciplinary institutions such as prisons seek to develop detailed individual psychological profiles of people, and seek to alter their behaviour at the same level. Where previously most people had been part of a relatively undifferentiated mass, individuality being the preserve of a prominent or notorious few, and even then a relatively thin individuality, a society of individuals now developed, where everyone is supposed to have their own individual life story. This constitutes the soul Foucault refers to.

5. Sexuality

The thread of individualization runs through his next book, the first of what were ultimately three volumes of his History of Sexuality. He gave this volume the title The Will to Knowledge. It appeared only a year after Discipline and Punish. Still, three courses at the Collège de France intervene between his lectures on matters penitential and the book on sexuality. The first, Psychiatric Power, picks up chronologically where The History of Madness had left off, and applies Foucault’s genealogical method to the history of psychiatry. The next year, 1975, Foucault gave a series of lectures entitled Abnormal. These link together the studies on the prison with those on psychiatry and the question of sexuality through the study of the category of the abnormal, to which criminals, the mad, and sexual “perverts” were all assigned. Parts of these lectures indeed effectively reappear in The Will to Knowledge.

Like Discipline and Punish, the Will to Knowledge contains both general and specific conclusions. Regarding the specific problem of sexuality, Foucault couches his thesis as a debunking of a certain received wisdom in relation to the history of sexuality that he calls “the repressive hypothesis.” This is the view that our sexuality has historically been repressed, particularly in the nineteenth century, but that during the twentieth century it has been progressively liberated, and that we need now to get rid of our remaining hang-ups about sex by talking openly and copiously about it. Foucault allows the core historical claim that there has been sexual repressiveness, but thinks that this is relatively unimportant in the history of sexuality. Much more important, he thinks, is an injunction to talk about our sexuality that has consistently been imposed even during the years of repressiveness, and is now intensified, ostensibly for the purpose of lifting our repression. Foucault again sees a disciplinary technique at work, namely confession. This began in the Catholic confessional, with the Church spreading the confessional impulse in relation to sex throughout society in the early modern period. Foucault thinks this impulse has since been made secular, particularly under the auspices of institutional psychiatry, introducing a general compulsion for everyone to tell the truth about themselves, with their sexuality a particular focus. For Foucault, there is no such thing as sexuality apart from this compulsion. That is, sexuality itself is not something that we naturally have, but rather something that has been invented and imposed.

The implication of his genealogy of sexuality is that “sex” as we understand it is an artificial construct within this recent “device” (dispositif) of sexuality. This includes both the category of the sexual, encompassing certain organs and acts, and “sex” in the sense of gender, an implication spelt out by Foucault in his introduction to the memoirs of Herculine Barbin, a nineteenth century French hermaphrodite, which Foucault discovered and arranged to have published. Foucault’s thought, and his work on sexuality in particular, has been immensely influential in the recent “third wave” of feminist thought. The interaction of Foucault and feminism is the topic of a dedicated article elsewhere in this encyclopedia.

6. Power

The most general claim of The Will to Knowledge, and of Foucault’s entire political thought, is his answer to the question of where machinations such as sex and discipline come from. Who and what is it that is responsible for the production of criminality via imprisonment? Foucault’s answer is, in a word, “power.” That is to say that no one in particular is producing these things, but that rather they are effects generated by the interaction of power relations, which produce intentions of their own, not necessarily shared by any individuals or institutions. Foucault’s account of power is the broadest of the conclusions of The Will to Knowledge. Although similar reflections on power can be found in Discipline and Punish and in lectures and interviews of the same period, The Will to Knowledge gives his most comprehensive account of power. Foucault understands power in terms of “strategies” which are produced through the concatenation of the power relations that exist throughout society, wherever people interact. As he explains in a later text, “The Subject and Power,” which effectively completes the account of power given in The Will to Knowledge, these relations are a matter of people acting on one another to make other people act in turn. Whenever we try to influence others, this is power. However, our attempts to influence others rarely turn out the way we expect; moreover, even when they do, we have very little idea what effects our actions on others’ have more broadly. In this way, the social effects of our attempts to influence other people run quite outside of our control or ken. This effect is neatly encapsulated in a remark attributed to Foucault that we may know what we do, but we do not know what what we do does. What it does is produce strategies that have a kind of life of their own. Thus, although no one in the prison system, neither the inmates, nor the guards, nor politicians, want prisons to produce a class of criminals, this is nonetheless what the actions of all the people involved do.

Controversy around Foucault’s political views has focused on his reconception of power. Criticisms of him on this point invariably fail, however, to appreciate his true position or beg the question against it by simply restating the views he has rejected. He has been interpreted as thinking that power is a mysterious, autonomous force that exists independently of any human influence, and is so all-encompassing as to preclude any resistance to it. Foucault clearly states in The Will to Knowledge that this is not so, though it is admittedly relatively difficult to understand his position, namely that resistance to power is not outside power. The point here for Foucault is not that resistance is futile, but that power is so ubiquitous that in itself it is not an obstacle to resistance. One cannot resist power as such, but only specific strategies of power, and then only with great difficulty, given the tendency of strategies to absorb apparently contradictory tendencies. Still, for Foucault power is never conceived as monolithic or autonomous, but rather is a matter of superficially stable structures emerging on the basis of constantly shifting relations underneath, caused by an unending struggle between people. Foucault explains this in terms of the inversion of Clausewitz’s dictum that war is diplomacy by other means into the claim that “politics is war by other means.” For Foucault, apparently peaceful and civilized social arrangements are supported by people locked in a struggle for supremacy, which is eternally susceptible to change, via the force of that struggle itself.

Foucault is nevertheless condemned by many liberal commentators for his failure to make any normative distinction between power and resistance, that is, for his relativism. This accusation is well founded: he consistently eschews any kind of overtly normative stance in his thought. He thus does not normatively justify resistance, but it is not clear there is any inherent contradiction in a non-normative resistance. This idea is coherent, though of course those who think it is impossible to have a non-normative political thought (which is a consensus position within political philosophy) will reject him on this basis. For his part, he offers only analyses that he hopes will prove useful to people struggling in concrete situations, rather than prescriptions as to what is right or wrong.

One last accusation, coming from a particularly noteworthy source, the most prominent living German philosopher, Jürgen Habermas, should also be mentioned. This accusation is namely that Foucault’s account of power is “functionalist.” Functionalism in sociology means taking society as a functional whole and thus reading every part as having distinct functions. The problem with this view is that society is not designed by anyone and consequently much of it is functionally redundant or accidental. Foucault does use the vocabulary of “function” on occasion in his descriptions of the operations of power, but does not show any allegiance to or even awareness of functionalism as a school of thought. His position in any case is not that society constitutes a totality or whole via any necessity: functions exist within strategies that emerge spontaneously from below, and the functions of any element are subject to change.

7. Biopower

Foucault’s position in relation to resistance implies not so much that one is defeated before one begins as that one must proceed with caution to avoid simply supporting a strategy of power while thinking oneself rebellious. This is for him what has happened in respect of sexuality in the case of the repressive hypothesis. Though we try to liberate ourselves from sexual repression, we in fact play into a strategy of power which we do not realize exists. This strategy is for everyone to constitute themselves as “‘subjects’ in both senses of the word,” a process Foucault designates “subjection” (assujettissement). The two senses here are passive and active. On the one hand, we are subjected in this process, made into passive subjects of study by medical professionals, for example. On the other, we are the subjects in this process, having to actively confess our sexual proclivities and indeed in the process develop an identity based on this confessed sexuality. So, power operates in ways that are both overtly oppressive and more positive.

Sexuality for Foucault has a quite extraordinary importance in the contemporary network of power relations. It has become the essence of our personal identity, and sex has come to be seen as “worth dying for.” Foucault details how sexuality had its beginnings as a preoccupation of the newly dominant bourgeois class, who were obsessed with physical and reproductive health, and their own pleasure. This class produced sexuality positively, though one can see that it would have been imposed on women and children within that class quite regardless of their wishes. For Foucault, there are four consistent strategies of the device of sexuality: the pathologisation of the sexuality of women and children, the concomitant medicalization of the sexually abnormal “pervert,” and the constitution of sexuality as an object of public concern. From its beginning in the bourgeoisie, Foucault sees public health agencies as imposing sexuality more crudely on the rest of the populace, quite against their wishes.

Why has this happened? For Foucault, the main explanation is how sexuality ties together multiple “technologies of power”, namely discipline on the one hand, and a newer technology, which he calls “bio-politics,” on the other. In The Will to Knowledge, Foucault calls this combination of discipline and bio-politics together “bio-power,” though confusingly he elsewhere seems to use “bio-power” and “bio-politics” as synonyms, notably in his 1976 lecture series, Society Must Be Defended. He also elsewhere dispenses with the hyphens in these words, as it will in the present article hereafter.

Biopolitics is a technology of power that grew up on the basis of disciplinary power. Where discipline is about the control of individual bodies, biopolitics is about the control of entire populations. Where discipline constituted individuals as such, biopolitics does this with the population. Prior to the invention of biopolitics, there was no serious attempt by governments to regulate the people who lived in a territory, only piecemeal violent interventions to put down rebellions or levy taxes. As with discipline, the main precursor to biopolitics can be found in the Church, which is the institution that did maintain records of births and deaths, and did minister to the poor and sick, in the medieval period. In the modern period, the perception grew among governments that interventions in the life of the people would produce beneficial consequences for the state, preventing depopulation, ensuring a stable and growing tax base, and providing a regular supply of manpower for the military. Hence they took an active interest in the lives of the people. Disciplinary mechanisms allowed the state to do this through institutions, most notably perhaps medical institutions that allowed the state to monitor and support the health of the population. Sex was the most intense site at which discipline and biopolitics intersected, because any intervention in population via the control of individual bodies fundamentally had to be about reproduction, and also because sex is one of the major vectors of disease transmission. Sex had to be controlled, regulated, and monitored if the population was to be brought under control.

There is another technology of power in play, however, older than discipline, namely “sovereign power.” This is the technology we glimpse at the beginning of Discipline and Punish, one that works essentially by violence and by taking, rather than by positively encouraging and producing as both discipline and biopolitics do. This form of power was previously the way in which governments dealt both with individual bodies and with masses of people. While it has been replaced in these two roles by discipline and biopower, it retains a role nonetheless at the limits of biopower. When discipline breaks down, when the regulation of the population breaks down, the state continues to rely on brute force as a last resort. Moreover, the state continues to rely on brute force, and the threat of it, in dealing with what lies outside its borders.

For Foucault, there is a mutual incompatibility between biopolitics and sovereign power. Indeed, he sometimes refers to sovereign power as “thanatopolitics,” the politics of death, in contrast to biopolitics’s politics of life. Biopolitics is a form of power that works by helping you to live, thanatopolitics by killing you, or at best allowing you to live. It seems impossible for any individual to be simultaneously gripped by both forms of power, notwithstanding a possible conflict between different states or state agencies. There is a need for a dividing line between the two, between who is to be “made to live,” as Foucault puts it, and who is to be killed or simply allowed to go on living indifferently. The most obvious dividing line is the boundary between the population and its outside at the border of a territory, but the “biopolitical border,” as it has been called by recent scholars, is not the same as the territorial border. In Society Must Be Defended, Foucault suggests there is a device he calls “state racism,” that comes variably into play in deciding who is to receive the benefits of biopolitics or be exposed to the risk of death.

Foucault does not use this term in any of the works he published himself, but nevertheless does point in The Will to Knowledge to a close relationship between biopolitics and racism. Discourses of scientific racism that emerged in the nineteenth century posited a link between the sexual “degeneracy” of individuals and the hygiene of the population at large. By the early twentieth century, eugenics, the pseudo-science of improving the vitality of a population through selective breeding, was implemented to some extent in almost all industrialized countries. It of course found its fullest expression in Nazi Germany. Nevertheless, Foucault is quite clear that there is something quite paradoxical about such attempts to link the old theme of “blood” to modern concerns with population health. The essential point about “state racism” is not then that it necessarily links to what we might ordinarily understand as racism in its strict sense, but that there has to be a dividing line in modern biopolitical states between what is part of the population and what is not, and that this is, in a broad sense, racist.

8. Governmentality

After the publication of The Will to Knowledge, Foucault took a one-year hiatus from lecturing at the Collège de France. He returned in 1978 with a series of lectures that followed logically from his 1976 ones, but show a distinct shift in conceptual vocabulary. Talk of “biopolitics” is almost absent. A new concept, “governmentality,” takes its place. The lecture series of 1978 and 1979, Security, Territory, Population and The Birth of Biopolitics, center on this concept, despite the somewhat misleading title of the latter in this regard.

“Governmentality” is a portmanteau word, derived from the phrase “governmental rationality.” A governmentality is thus a logic by which a polity is governed. But this logic is for Foucault, in keeping with his genealogical perspective (which he still affirms), not merely ideal, but rather encompasses institutions, practices and ideas. More specifically, Foucault defines governmentality in Security, Territory, Population as allowing for a complex form of “power which has the population as its target, political economy as its major form of knowledge, and apparatuses of security as its essential technical instrument” (pp. 107–8). Confusingly, however, Foucault in the same breath also defines other senses in which he will use the term “governmentality.” He will use it not only to describe this recent logic of government, but as the longer tendency in Western history that has led to it, and the specific process in the early modern period by which modern governmentality was formed.

“Governmentality” is a slippery concept then. Still, it is an important one. Governmentality seems to be closely contemporaneous and functionally isomorphic with biopolitics, hence seems to replace it in Foucault’s thought. That said, unlike biopolitics, it never figures in a major publication of his – he only allowed one crucial lecture of Security, Territory, Population to be published under the title of “Governmentality,” in an Italian journal. It is via the English translation of this essay that this concept has become known in English, this one essay of Foucault’s in fact inspiring an entire school of sociological reflection.

What is the meaning of this fuzzy concept then? Foucault never repudiates biopower. During these lectures he on multiple occasions reaffirms his interest in biopower as an object of study, and does so as late as 1983, the year before he died. The meaning of governmentality as a concept is to situate biopower in a larger historical moment, one that stretches further back in history and encompasses more elements, in particular the discourses of economics and regulation of the economy.

Foucault details two main phases in the development of governmentality. The first is what he identifies as raison d’État, literally “reason of state.” This is the central object of study of Security, Territory, Population. It correlates the technology of discipline, as an attempt to regulate society to the fullest extent, with what was contemporaneously called “police.” This governmentality gave way by the eighteenth century to a new form of governmentality, what will become political liberalism, which reacts against the failures of governmental regulation with the idea that society should be left to regulate itself naturally, with the power of police applied only negatively in extremis. This for Foucault is broadly the governmentality that has lasted to this day, and is the object of study of The Birth of Biopolitics in its most recent form, what is called “neo-liberalism.” With this governmentality, we see freedom of the individual and regulation of the population subtly intertwined.

9. Ethics

The 1980s see a significant turn in Foucault’s work, both in terms of the discourses he attends to and the vocabulary he uses. Specifically, he focuses from now on mainly on Ancient texts from Greece and Rome, and prominently uses the concepts of “subjectivity” and “ethics.” None of these elements is entirely new to his work, but they assume novel prominence and combination at this point.

There is an article elsewhere in this encyclopedia about Foucault’s ethics. The question here is what the specifically political import of this ethics is. It is often assumed that the meaning of Foucault’s ethics is to retract his earlier political thought and thus to recant on that political project, retreating from political concerns towards a concern with individual action. There is a grain of truth to such allegations, but no more than a grain. While certainly Foucault’s move to the consideration of ethics is a move away from an explicitly political engagement, there is no recantation or contradiction of his previous positions, only the offering of an account of subjectivity and ethics that might enrich these.

Foucault’s turn towards subjectivity is similar to his earlier turn towards power: he seeks to add a dimension to the accounts and approach he has built up. As in the case of power, he does so not by helping himself to an available approach, but by producing a new one: Foucault’s own account of subjectivity is original and quite different to the extant accounts of subjectivity he rejected in his earlier work. Subjectivity for Foucault is a matter of people’s ability to shape their own conduct. In this way, his account relates to his previous work on government, with subjectivity a matter of the government of the self. It is thus closely linked to his political thought, as a question of the power that penetrates the interior of the person.

“Ethics” too is understood in this terms. Foucault does not produce an “ethics” in the sense that the word is conventionally used today to mean a normative morality, nor indeed does he produce a “political philosophy” in the sense that that phrase is conventionally used, which is to say a normative politics. “Ethics” for Foucault is rather understood etymologically by reference to Ancient Greek reflection on the ethike, which is to say, on character. Ancient Greek ethics was marked by what Foucault calls the “care of the self”: it is essentially a practice of fashioning the self. In such practices, Foucault sees a potential basis for resistance to power, though he is clear that no truly ethical practices exist today and it is by no means clear that they can be reestablished. Ethics has, on the contrary, been abnegated by Christianity with its mortificatory attitude to the self. This account of ethics can be found primarily in Foucault’s last three lecture series at the Collège de France, The Hermeneutics of the Subject, The Government of the Self and Others and The Courage of the Truth.

10. References and Further Reading

English translations of works by Foucault named above, in the order they were originally written.

a. Primary

    • Mental illness and psychology. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1987.
    • The History of Madness. London: Routledge, 2006.
    • Birth of the Clinic. London: Routledge, 1989.
    • The Order of Things. London: Tavistock, 1970.
    • The Archaeology of Knowledge. New York: Pantheon, 1972.
    • "The order of discourse," in M. Shapiro, ed., Language and politics (Blackwell, 1984), pp. 108-138. Translated by Ian McLeod.
    • Psychiatric Power. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2006.
    • Discipline and Punish. London: Allen Lane, 1977.
    • Abnormal. London: Verso, 2003.
    • Society Must Be Defended. New York: Picador, 2003.
    • An Introduction. Vol. 1 of The History of Sexuality. New York: Pantheon, 1978. Reprinted as The Will to Knowledge, London: Penguin, 1998.
    • Security, Territory, Population. New York: Picador, 2009
    • The Birth of Biopolitics. New York: Picador, 2010
    • "Introduction" M. Foucault, ed., Herculine Barbin: being the recently discovered memoirs of a nineteenth-century French hermaphrodite Brighton, Sussex: Harvester Press, 1980, pp. vii-xvii. Translated by Richard McDougall.
    • “The Subject and Power,” J. Faubion, ed., Power. New York: New Press, 2000, pp. 326-348.
    • The Hermeneutics of the Subject. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2005.
    • The Government of the Self and Others. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2010.
    • The Courage of the Truth. New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2011.

The shorter writings and interviews of Foucault are also of extraordinary interest, particularly to philosophers. In French, these have been published in an almost complete collection, Dits et écrits, by Gallimard, first in four volumes and more recently in a two-volume edition. In English, Foucault’s shorter works are spread across many overlapping anthologies, which even between them omit much that is important. The most important of these anthologies for Foucault’s political thought are:

  • J. Faubion, ed., Power Vol. 3, Essential Works. New York: New Press, 2000.
  • Colin Gordon, ed., Power/Knowledge. Brighton, Sussex: Harvester Press, 1980.

b. Secondary

  • Graham Burchell, Colin Gordon and Peter Miller (eds.), The Foucault Effect. Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1991.
    • An edited collection that is a mixture of primary and secondary sources. Both parts of the book have been extraordinarily influential. If constitutes a decent primer on governmentality.
  • Gilles Deleuze, Foucault. Trans. Seán Hand. London: Athlone, 1988.
    • The best book about Foucault’s work, from one who knew him. Though predictably idiosyncratic, it is still a pointedly political reading.
  • David Couzens Hoy (ed.), Foucault: A Critical Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 1986.
    • An excellent selection of critical essays, mostly specifically political.
  • Mark G. E. Kelly, The Political Philosophy of Michel Foucault. New York: Routledge, 2009.
    • A comprehensive treatment of Foucault’s political thought from a specifically philosophical angle
  • John Rajchman, Michel Foucault: The Freedom of Philosophy. New York: Columbia University Press, 1985.
    • An idiosyncratic reading of Foucault that is particularly good at synthesising his entire career according to the political animus behind it.
  • Jon Simons, Foucault and the Political. London: Routledge, 1995.
    • The first work to focus on Foucault’s thought from a political introduction, this survey of his work serves well as a general introduction to the topic, though it necessarily lacks consideration of much that has appeared in English since its publication.
  • Barry Smart (ed.), Michel Foucault: Critical Assessments (multi-volume). London: Routledge, 1995.
    • Includes multiple sections on Foucault’s political thought.

Author Information

Mark Kelly
Middlesex University
United Kingdom

Feminism and Race in the United States

This article traces the history of U.S. mainstream feminist thought from an essentialist notion of womanhood based on the normative model of middle-class white women’s experiences, to a recognition that women are, in fact, quite diverse and see themselves differently. It begins with the question of the social construction of gender and the mainstream feminist assumption that ‘woman’ means middle class white woman. The challenge to this assumption is then posed by women of color, poor women, immigrants, lesbians and women in the ’third world.” Section Three presents the various forms of inclusion of black women within mainstream feminist frameworks. Following that is a discussion on the construction of whiteness, the privileges that race afford white women, and feminist strategies to overcome racism within mainstream feminism. Section Five reviews the struggles of Latina and Asian American women, the specific questions of identity they confront, and how these relate to mainstream feminism. Section Six discusses the challenges posed to U.S. mainstream feminism by third world feminists.

Feminists in the U.S. have worked arduously to address the question of difference among women, together with what unites women in common contexts of struggle.  The focus on difference, as well as identity, however, often overlooks the actual lives of many women of color who struggle not so much with how to disabuse themselves of a certain identity, but with how to establish one in the first place.  Concentrating on identity and difference, either by working to obliterate or represent it, also tends to the neglect of power relations that establish, hold apart, and bring together such differences in the first place.

This article further explores how sexism and racism are structural problems endemic to American culture. As such, they need to be addressed systematically, along with class and all other systems of domination. The structural aspect is evident in the ease by which biological racism morphs into cultural racism, spawning condescending and racist attitudes toward third world women, and a blindness of “first world” complicity in third world oppressions. As Audre Lorde has made clear, “the master’s tools will never dismantle the master’s house.” The conclusion explores how feminists unite to struggle against systems of domination and exploitation, and work to give up privileges bequeathed by these systems, admittedly an uncomfortable proposition for those benefiting from power, to dismantle the “master’s house” and the multitude of oppressions that it sustains.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Are All Women the Same?
  3. Mainstream Feminism and African American Women in the United States
  4. White Privilege and the Question of Racism in U.S. Mainstream Feminism
  5. Chicana/Latina and Asian American Women and U.S. Mainstream Feminism
  6. Third World Feminisms and Mainstream Feminism in the U.S.
  7. Conclusion: “There is No Hierarchy of Oppressions”
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The question of difference has been central to U.S. feminism since the inception of a women’s movement in the United States.  When Sojourner Truth, a black woman, walked into the predominately white Women’s Convention in Akron, Ohio in 1851, three years after the first Women’s Rights Convention in Seneca Falls, New York, jaws dropped. Not a sound could be heard.  Truth was an imposing woman.  She stood almost 6 feet tall and bore the scars of brutal beatings, the sale of her children, and the loss of her own parents while she was sold off into slavery.  Surrounded by affluent, educated white women and their gentlemen supporters, her presence at first stirred fear, but eventually gave rise to awe. The white women at the conference didn’t want to muddy their struggle and demands for women’s rights with the uncomfortable subject of race and the rights of colored folk, despite their debt to Fredrick Douglass’ efforts to keep the controversial issue of women’s suffrage central at the first Convention in Seneca Falls. Yet, when Truth rose to enter into the conversation, her words, collected under the title “Ain’t I a Woman,” not only drew strong admiration, but presaged what would come to be the fundamental question of Western feminism: What exactly is a woman?

In the speech titled “Ain’t I a Woman,” Truth reveals the contradictions inherent to the use and meaning of the term woman, and exposes the political, economic, and cultural assumptions underlying its use.  Taking the platform at the Convention in Ohio, she spoke out against the declarations of several men. They believed that women were to refrain from strenuous work, both physical and mental, so to better fulfill their "womanly nature." But Truth knew nothing of this so-called nature that they espoused and engendered. What she knew was toil and work as arduous as any man could endure.

That man over there says that women need to be helped into carriages, and lifted over ditches, and to have the best place everywhere. Nobody ever helps me into carriages, or over mud-puddles, or gives me any best place! And ain't I a woman?  Look at me! Look at my arm! I have plowed, and planted, and have gathered into barns, and no man could head me! And ain't I a woman? I could work as much, and eat as much as man - when I could get it - and bear the lash as well! And ain't I a woman? I have borne thirteen children and seen most all sold off to slavery, and when I cried out with a mother's grief, none but Jesus heard me! And ain't I a woman?   (Truth, 2009).

Almost one hundred years later, Truth's questioning can be heard in Simone de Beauvoir’s challenge to claims that the meaning of womanhood is self-evident.  In her groundbreaking and canonical work The Second Sex (1949, 1st English trans., 1953), Beauvoir set the course for the subsequent study of the “woman question” in the West by putting the issue of gender into focus. Responding to male discontentment that French women were losing their femininity and were not as "womanly" as they believed Russian women to be, Beauvoir wondered if one is born a woman or whether, in fact, one must become a woman through various socialization and indoctrination processes. This critical perspective led her to challenge the usefulness of the category of woman altogether and to ask whether it was, in fact, helpful as a term representing all the experiences of the so-called members of the "second sex."  Perhaps nothing better illustrates Beauvoir’s concerns regarding the legitimacy and effectiveness of the category of "woman" than the development of white, U.S. mainstream feminist thought in relation to challenges posed by women of color, the poor, lesbians, immigrants, and women from "third world" nations.   In making their voices heard, these marginalized women expanded feminist thinking by showing that ideologies of womanhood had just as much to do with race, class, and sexuality, as they had to do with sex.

2. Are All Women the Same?

Feminists in the U.S. have set out to identify, expose, and subvert the longstanding gender stereotypes that have been used to dominate and subordinate women.  Central to any theory of feminism, then, is how terms like “woman,” “female,” and “feminine” are construed or misconstrued.  The pioneer women in the U.S. suffragist movement spoke of and fought for women’s rights, using the term woman to signify all women.  What they failed to recognize was that their notion of womanhood was modeled on the experiences and problems of a small percentage of females who, like them, were almost exclusively white, middle-class, and relatively well-educated.  However, the assumption that middle-class white women’s experiences represented all women’s experiences was not only made by the early Suffragists, but continued to shape the ideal of womanhood well into the second wave of the American feminist movement and beyond.

In The Problem That Has No Name, a book that helped usher in the second wave of feminism in the U.S., Betty Friedan exposed the hidden frustrations of women who had bought into the “mystique of feminine fulfillment” (2001:24). Trading in their career ambitions for the promised bliss of marriage, motherhood, and domesticity, many women instead found themselves trapped and isolated behind white picket fences in what Friedan described as the “housewife’s syndrome.”  But, what Friedan also failed to recognize was that this syndrome affected only a certain minority of women— namely, those who were white, middle-class, and often highly educated, like herself.   She did not realize that the binary and complimentary gender divisions she assumed, woman as breadmaker and man as breadwinner, were built upon a racialized patriarchy that excluded women of color, the poor, and immigrants from this “mystique of femininity.”   It was these women who would be called upon to leave their children and homes to care for the children and homes of the white women who had successfully “liberated” themselves from domesticity to voluntarily enter into the work force.

Discounting the lives of women of color by assuming that the experiences of white women were representative of the lives of all women, Friedan imagines a unity among women’s experiences that simply does not exist.  According to bell hooks, this ideal of gender solidarity is built upon an assumption of sameness that is supported by the idea that there exists a common oppression of patriarchy around which women must rally.  “The idea of ‘common oppression’ was a false and corrupt platform disguising and mystifying the true nature of women’s varied and complex social reality” (1984:44). This complexity is especially disclosed in the lives of women of color who must contend with multiple and overlapping forms of oppressions--including oppression by white women, who fail to acknowledge the different struggles confronting women who are not like them.

Mainstream feminist thought continues to grapple with the interrelations between gender and race, as well as class, colonialism, imperialism, and issues of sexual orientation in what might arguably be called a third wave of feminism in the U.S..  More importantly, the critiques of women who have suffered the most from sexist societies -- women of color, the poor, third world women -- are now at the forefront of a contemporary, progressive feminist politics.  Thus, to understand the current contours of mainstream feminist thought in the U.S. and the question of race, one must look at how feminist theory and practice have addressed differences among women, and the specific ways that differences within women’s lives have shaped their relationships to mainstream U.S. feminism.

3. Mainstream Feminism and African American Women in the United States

Feminist theorists have addressed the relationship of race and feminism in at least two different ways. One approach is to view race as integral to gender and explore the ways in which gender identity is constructed in relation to race, and how racial identity is equally constructed in relation to gender.  The other follows a method whereby the voices of women of color are added to the conventional curriculum in a sort of separate but equal manner. This latter approach has been called the “additive” approach. Because it simply adds the voices of those historically excluded from the mainstream feminist canon, but does not examine the constitution of these voices within the contexts of power that have given rise to them, it carries the risk of essentializing gender and race, or assuming these categories to be fixed and timeless.

With respect to the former, Jacquelyn Dowd Hal highlights the interconnections of race and gender in her discussion of lynching. Hal shows that lynching was not only used to enforce labor contracts, maintain racial etiquette and the socio-economic status quo, but was also effective in re-inscribing gender roles among whites. White men cast themselves as protectors of white women, sheltering them from the presumed threat of black male sexual prowess, while simultaneously securing white women’s adherence to ideals of chastity and femininity (Brooks-Higginbootham, 1989: 132).  These ideals were further re-inscribed by white women in their perceptions and accusations regarding black male sexuality.  Ida B. Wells had made the same observation, arguing that white men maintained their ownership over white women’s bodies by using them as the terrain for lynching black males (Carby, 1986: 309). It comes as little surprise, then, that by joining anti-lynching campaigns white women were not only defending black males, but simultaneously reacting against Southern chivalry and their roles as fragile sex objects (Brooks-Higginbootham, 1989: 133).

The more popular approach to the question of race and feminism, however, seems to have been the "additive" approach.  In “Toward a Black Feminist Criticism” (1977), Barbara Smith embarks on a journey that she states no man or woman has gone on before: documenting black women’s experience and culture while providing black women with a resource for reading about their lives. “It is galling that ostensible feminists and acknowledged lesbians have been so blinded to the implications of any womanhood that is not white womanhood and that they have yet to struggle with the deep racism in themselves that is at the source of this blindness” (Carby, 1992: 158).  Smith believes that it is necessary both to retrieve the writings of black women and to place them before black feminist literary critics who are able to interpret these writers experiences.  She argues that black women writers share a singular tradition of styles, themes and aesthetics that are rooted in a shared culture of oppression.  Furthermore, she believes that these themes are expressed in a uniquely black woman’s language that is accessible only to black feminist literary critics who simply need turn inwards, or towards their own lived experiences, in order to decipher the messages told by black women writers (Carby, 1992:164). With her novel idea of an “identity politics,” Smith went on to form the black lesbian feminist Combahee River Collective in Boston.

“The Combahee River Collective Statement” (1986), along with This Bridge Called My Back, Writings by Radical Women of Color, published two years earlier, gave voice to women of color and served as the primary texts from which white women and women of color would draw in discussions of race and gender.  In the Combahee Statement, the Collective explained their need to organize and come together as black women into a movement for black women. “We realize that the only people who care enough about us to work consistently for our liberation is us.  Our politics evolve from a healthy love for ourselves, our sisters, and our community, which allows us to continue our struggle and our work” (1995: 21-22). Black-only movements worked to raise the self-esteem of black women and address specific problems confronting all black people. Angela Davis also describes how, despite the sexist and heterosexist elements of the Black Nationalist Movement, it gave her a framework within which to understand herself as beautiful and valuable. In addition, Black Nationalism also served to counter racist images of African-Americans by providing positive images of Africa.  “I was able to construct a psychological space within which I could ‘feel good about myself.’ I could celebrate my body (especially my nappy hair, which I always attacked with a hot comb in ritualistic seclusion), my musical proclivities and my suppressed speech patterns, among other things…This distanced me from the white people around me while simultaneously rendering controllable the distance I had always felt from them” (1992:319).

Patricia Hill Collins invokes the notion of a shared black women’s language and highlights a common tradition that reaches back to the idea of an "African consciousness." However, she cautions against carving out a uniquely black female voice, or category of experience, for fear of sliding into an essentialist perspective which may, ultimately, be counterproductive. She recognizes that identifying a black feminist thought problematically assumes that "being Black and/or female generates certain experiences that automatically determine the variants of a Black and/or feminist consciousness” (1991:21). Still, Collins maintains that black women have certain perspectives that arise out of a shared experience, along with a different relation to knowledge production that give rise to a uniquely “black feminist standpoint” (1991:21-22).

Collins draws on the mainstream feminist strategy of “standpoint theory” that Nancy Hartsock helped develop out of Karl Marx’s insight that the material conditions of existence structure one's lived experiences,. A standpoint theory argues that the place from which one stands influences the perspective or view that one has of the world; and, further, that those who are most oppressed are able to provide a broader and clearer perspective on the whole of society and societal relations (Hartsock, 1999).  Collins believes that any black feminist standpoint must take into account white domination, the concomitant struggle for self-definition, and the Afrocentric worldview that helps blacks cope with racial domination. This Afrocentricism, Collins claims, existed prior to,and is independent of, racial oppression. Moreover, it has given rise to traditions of storytelling and narrative that value concrete, lived experience, as well as black women’s community and sisterhood (1991:206, 212). Collins’ version of standpoint feminism, therefore, focuses on concrete lived experiences that have their roots in African oral traditions, black families, churches, and other black organizations.

But even the idea of this mitigated account of an essential black female identity does not sit well with many black women. For example, Hazel Carby sees the idea of black feminist criticism, as well as any notion of a specifically black feminist consciousness, as a problem and not a solution. She traces this problem to the processes whereby one finds academic legitimation by aiming to fit into certain allotted slots that are open for discussions of racial and gender identity within mainstream curricula.  Carby advocates the need to examine racism and sexism not as trans-historical and essentialist categories, but as historical practices which are enmeshed with evolving sets of social, political, and economic practices that function to maintain power in a given context and society (1989:18).  Any emphasis on the elaboration of standpoint theory, Carby claims, sanctions the segregation and ghettoization of race and gender, while simultaneously positing white women as a normative standard (1992:193 ).

Moreover, Carby believes that this supplemental approach, which consists simply in adding the experiences and writings of women of color to the established mainstream feminist canon, will not solve the problems of “exclusion” from mainstream feminism, but will instead further reify differences.  Joan Scott echoes these remarks and cautions women against relying on an uncritical deployment of experience to tell their stories.  By assuming experience to be self-evident and transparent, one naturalizes difference and leaves unexamined the constitutive mechanisms according to which people’s experiences have been historically constructed by relational webs of power and multiple oppressions (1991: 25-26).   These mechanisms are structural and institutional. They are therefore more difficult to identify and eradicate. To adequately address the root causes of racism in the feminist movement, women must therefore acknowledge that any attempt to universalize their experiences colludes, not only with ideologies of white womanhood, but also with the dominant and privileged white male norms.  The prominence given to white women’s experience, Carby points out, is no accident. “White women are made visible because they are the women that white men see” (1986: 302). Taking into account the historical and political contexts that define gender reveals the racial constructions that structure both the lives of whites and people of color.

Many black women, especially those excluded from the earlier Suffragist movement, went even further and drew an explicit link between imperialism, racism, and patriarchy. This link was cemented at the 1893 World’s Columbian Exposition in Chicago, where a group of black women who had thought they were there to represent the lives of American women, were instead made part of exhibits featuring “exotic” peoples, which further fed into racist stereotypes and fears (Carby, 1986).  Subsequently, these women came to recognize the need to form their own national organizations.  In 1896, a number of black women’s groups merged into the National Association of Colored Women (NACW), headed by Josephine Ruffin and Mary Church Terrell. Its members included Harriet Tubman, Frances E.W. Harper, and Ida Bell Wells-Barnett. Harper and Anna J Cooper, the fourth African American woman to earn a Doctorate in the U.S., saw an inseparable link between imperialism, domestic racial oppression, and unrestrained patriarchal power. Cooper writes in A Voice from the South: By A Woman from the South (1892):

“Whence came this apotheosis of greed and cruelty? Whence this sneaking admiration we all have for bullies and prizefighters?  Whence the self-congratulation of ‘dominant’ races, as if ‘dominant’ meant ‘righteous’ and carried with it a title to inherit the earth? Whence the scorn of so-called weak or unwarlike races and individuals, and the very comfortable assurance that it is their manifest destiny to be wiped out as vermin before the advancing civilization?” (Carby, 1986:305).

Cooper’s observations came 40 years after Arthur de Gobineau declared in The Inequality of Races, that, indeed, Africans were “incapable of civilization” because they did not have the drive or ambition to conquer their neighbors, but rather lived “side by side in complete independence of each other” (Bernasconi, 2000:47). It was this conquering drive that Gobineau argued marked European civilization as advanced in contrast to the backwardness of Africans, who practiced living in harmonious co-existence with their neighbors.

In recognition of the advantages that race has conferred upon white women, many feminists have embarked upon analyses of race and gender that moves towards an acknowledgment of white privilege and racial injustice. Feminists have also worked to develop strategies for addressing white racism and identifying power differentials between women, between men, and among white women and men of color.

4. White Privilege and the Question of Racism in U.S. Mainstream Feminism

In 1988, inspired by the model of how men gain advantage from women’s disadvantage, Peggy McIntosh began to document some of the ways in which white women have benefited from racism.  Having observed how men were taught not to recognize their male privilege, McIntosh explored some of the unconscious avenues that allow white women not to recognize their “unearned skin privilege” (2008:63). “[W]hites are taught to think of their lives as morally neutral, normative, and average, and also ideal, so that when we work to benefit others, this work is seen as work that will allow ‘them’ to be more like ‘us’” (2008:63). Positioning whites as the norm is seen by Anna Stubblefield as pivotal to securing the superiority of whites. “The ideology of white supremacy is that whiteness sets the standard—whiteness is normative—such that anything that is symbolic of or associated with blackness is therefore deviant”  (2005:74).

McIntosh describes how she was taught to view racism as prejudice or bigotry, and to subscribe discriminatory acts of cruelty to isolated individuals, rather than to acknowledge “invisible systems conferring racial domination on my group from birth” (2008:68). She lists the unearned advantages that come from being a member of the dominant group, such as the comfort that comes from being in situations that reflect the worldview, values, and ideals of whites. White privilege ranges from the confidence white parents have that their children will receive educational materials highlighting the accomplishments and contributions of their race, to not attributing acts of injustice to racial prejudices, and not having to stand as a representative for one’s particular racial group. Marilyn Frye further discusses the privilege that whites have to define or determine how others will see them. More specifically, she contrasts the images and ideals that whites have of themselves with the ways in which they are viewed by men and women of color to underscore the disparity in perceptions (2001:85).  Because whites are taught that they are moral, honest, and fair, they believe that they alone are capable of and responsible for teaching others about what is right and wrong. This confidence is built upon a body of established Western principles, codes, and rules that presume to guarantee the correctness of their moral judgments. However, these self-descriptions of the dominant racial group are not shared by the majority of people of color who view many whites as behaving arbitrarily, or in a self-serving, violent, and often oppressive ways.

In “The Whiteness Question” (2005), Linda Alcoff argues that the key to overcoming racism lies in a confrontation with the “psychic processes of identity formation[.]”  Tracing the origins of whiteness to domination and exploitation, Alcoff asserts that “whiteness” is inseparable from the subjection, denigration, objectification, and repudiation of those who are perceived as non-white. “The very genealogy of whiteness was entwined from the beginning with a racial hierarchy, which can be found in every major cultural narrative from Christopher Columbus to Manifest Destiny to the Space Race and the Computer Revolution”  (2005). Before the concept of race originated in the 16th century, various populations of people identified and structured their communities in varieties of ways that did not include reference to skin color.  The origins of the category of race are, indeed, the origins of European expansion and oppression against Africans, Asians, indigenous peoples in the Americas and Australia, and even Muslims.  According to G.W.F. Hegel, it is only Europeans, or, more precisely, Christians who are able to attain the highest level of reason and spirituality by distancing themselves from the “absolute” through rationality.   Africans are not able to actualize these higher mental and spiritual faculties because they fetishize the absolute by objectifying it in relics that they then toss away when their fetish fails to come to their aid.  Muslims too, while successful at raising God above the level of the sensuous, are nevertheless unable to bring God back down to earth and unite the universal with the concrete, and therefore are unable to attain self-conscious reason (Bernasconi, 2000).

Alcoff, therefore, concludes that white collective self-esteem and identity are rooted in forms of white supremacy. Thus, to break free from racist ideology may not be such an easy task for whites, as it threatens the very foundations of their pride and self-love. This threat arises from the acknowledgement that historical achievements, and the legacy of cultural resources from which a white identity is drawn, are steeped in practices of racial oppression and domination. Consequently, relinquishing racism means not only giving up the actual privileges and benefits that are associated with being white, but may involve shunning one's ties to a cultural history upon which white personal esteem and sense of self are grounded.  Feelings of hysteria, shame, and anxiety often accompany this break.  Yet, belonging to a history is crucial to one’s esteem and identity. Alcoff, therefore, suggests a form of “white double consciousness” that moves from a recognition of practices of domination, exploitation, and discrimination to “a newly awakened memory of the many white traitors to white privilege who have struggled to contribute to the building of an inclusive human community. The Michelangelos stand beside the Christopher Columbuses, and Michael Moores next to the Pat Buchanans” (2005).

The interrelationship between white identity and white supremacy has lead some anti-racist whites, most notably Noel Ignatiev, to go further and to call for the overall abolition of the white race: “Treason to whiteness is loyalty to humanity” (1997). Marilyn Frye similarly advocates a disassociation from “whiteness” by calling for whites to opt out of the club she calls “whiteliness” (2001: 85). The very conditions for disclaiming whiteness, a disclaiming of identity that some women of color point out is possible only for whites, rests in the understanding that race is something socially constructed.  Frye explains that being white “is like being a member of a political party, or a club, or a fraternity—or being a Methodist or a Mormon” (2001:85).

The possibility of relinquishing "whiteliness," therefore, involves a recognition of its contingency, and depends upon the repudiation of practices that arise from enacting, embodying and animating whiteness. Transforming consciousness is one step toward eliminating whiteliness.  However, Frye and McIntosh are clearly aware that reflection and reorientation address only a fraction of the problems associated with race, since most of these are stubbornly structural and institutional. Still, Linda Gordon fears that a failure to begin addressing these difficult problems merely contributes towards legitimating more of the same—whites talking only about themselves (1991).

Sarita Srivastava is similarly unhappy with the direction that discussions of race have taken insofar as they tend toward white self-examination and constructions of whiteness. When analysis of race and racism occurs in feminist organizations, the emphasis, she finds, often falls on white guilt rather than organizational change. This results in self-centered strategies by whites to correct their moral self-image, an image that sustains inequalities, and, Srivastava argues, is rooted in the very foundations of feminism, imperialism, and nationalism that are the target of change.(2005: 36). Rather than work directly to alter the order of racial oppression, white women instead strive to empathize with the victims. Empathy serves to underscore white women’s “goodness,” and transforms the essentially socio-political nature of the problem to a more personal one. This practice further reinforces decades of racist and colonialist practices by validating white women’s moral authority and their belief that they have somehow been entrusted with the responsibility to educate and liberate those less civilized (2005: 44). Thus, Srivastava argues that white women fail to genuinely confront their own racism by focusing on their guilt and, in doing so, maintain power inequities.  She quotes a woman of color’s frustration over white women’s refusal to look at their racism during political discussions on the topic of race.  “The indignant response, anger, the rage that turns to tears, the foot stomping, temper tantrum, which are very typical responses [to being called racist]. Every single organization that I have been in, every single one. So I realized that it wasn’t about me…after awhile [laughter]” (2005: 42-43).

Alcoff further shows how white feminists distance themselves from a serious critique of racism by focusing on behavior modification, rather than challenging oppressive institutional structures and calling for wealth redistribution.  In her analysis of Judith Katz’s White Awareness: Handbook for Anti-Racism Training (Katz 1978), Alcoff describes Katz’s depiction of how she came to terms with the depth of her own racism as a painful, demoralizing process that threatened her self-trust.  While Katz warns against wallowing in white guilt, she nonetheless links anti-racism to psychological liberation while, at the same time, distancing herself from the workings and mechanisms of racist practices that are endemic to the culture. The focus on difference and overcoming of difference, either by obliterating or representing it, tends to neglect the power relations that establish, hold apart, and bring together such differences in the first place. Concentrating on identity and difference also overlooks the actual lives of many women of color who struggle, not so much with how to disabuse themselves of a certain identity, but, to the contrary, with how to establish an identity in the first place.

5. Chicana/Latina and Asian American Women and U.S. Mainstream Feminism

Struggling to negotiate and come to terms with an identity, many women of color are not as eager as white women to give up their racial or ethnic distinctiveness. “To be oppressed,” Norma Alarcon explains, “means to be disenabled not only from grasping an ‘identity’, but also from reclaiming it” (1995:364).  Moreover, specific histories of oppressions have positioned women differently with regard to gender roles and the family.  Cherrie Moraga describes how Latina women’s relationships to ideals of gender and motherhood have been uniquely shaped by colonization. Accompanying European expansion and colonization, was the concomitant threat of genocide. The fear of extinction strengthened the commitment to traditional family ideals and roles, such as encouraging women to be pregnant and assuming males at the head of the household.  “At all costs, la familia must be preserved…We believe the more severely we protect the sex roles with the family, the stronger we will be as a unity in opposition to the anglo threat” (1995:181). Consequently, Moraga explains, Latina feminists’ relation to gender roles and the structure of the family confront a very particular kind of resistance.  While mainstream feminists are challenging traditional sex roles of men and women, some Latina feminists, due to their certain histories of colonization, seek to preserve these roles.  Thus, Latina women’s concerns are often foreign to, and often in direct opposition to, mainstream white feminists who seek to abolish or overcome conventional forms of gender identity, especially within the family.

U.S. immigration policies and discriminatory practices against Asian Americans have also sometimes lead to the embracing of gender ideals among Asian American women that are in opposition to the ideals of many white feminists in the U.S..  Ester Ngan-Ling Chow shows how racism, colonialism, and imperialism have worked to position Asian American women differently toward Asian American men, feminism, and Westernization.  Addressing the apparent lack of feminist consciousness and activism in Asian American women, she attributes this deficit to ethnic pride and solidarity with Asian American men to end racial discrimination against Asians in the U.S..  Asian American men, for example, often view Asian American women’s engagement with mainstream U.S. feminism as a threat to the Asian American community.  Chow also points to specific Asiatic values of obedience, filial duty, loyalty, fatalism, and self-control that encourage forms of submissiveness among Asian American women that are incompatible with American values of individualism and self-assertiveness.  The force of traditional Asian values contributes to the particularity of Asian American women’s struggles, and work to distance their struggle from the concerns of the mainstream, white feminist movement. These differences, among others, are why Chow states: “The development of feminist consciousness for Asian American women cannot be judged or understood through the experience of White women” (1991:266).

Yen Le Espiritu further discusses the complexities surrounding the intersections of race, class, and gender confronting Asian American women.  Regrettably, some Asian American women find themselves victims of the discrimination faced by Asian American men.  Among other things, Espiritu writes, racial ideology defines Asian American men as feminine and weak—a rendering that incidentally works to confirm the notion that manhood is white.  Frustrated also by the higher value placed on Asian American women’s employability, some Asian American men try to assert their power by physically abusing the women and children in their lives.  Breathing humor into these problems of physical abuse, Espiritu draws upon a joke that gets a laugh from both men and women. “When we get on the plane to go back to Laos, the first thing we will do is beat up the women!’” (Espiritu, 1997: 136). Despite the discriminations Asian American women endure within their community, they too often find it difficult to juggle between the desire to expose male privilege, and the desire to unite with men in their shared struggle against prejudice and discrimination.

Gloria Anzaldua describes the particular ways that a feminist consciousness is developed by Latina women who many times find themselves struggling to arrive at a positive image of themselves.  She explains how an internalization of racism and colonialist mentality has given rise to shame, self-hatred, and abuse of other Latina women in various communities. Self-hatred and the hatred one has towards others like oneself are further ignited by jostling for the limited positions of superiority that are open to women of color.  Here is where ethnic and cultural identity begin to be conflated with race and purported biological distinctions.  In the early phases of colonialism, European colonizers flexed their powers overtly in order to destroy the fabric, legal codes, cultural systems, mannerisms, language and habits of the colonized under the guise of civilizing the “savage natives.”  Slowly, local inhabitants internalized Western values, attitudes, and ways of life, including racialized thinking that resulted in a desire for some Latin Americans to become more white and reject their indigenous cultures.  “Like them we try to impose our version of ‘the ways things should be’, we try to impose one’s self on the Other by making her the recipient of one’s negative elements, usually the same elements that the Anglo projected on us” (1995: 143).

More graphically, Anzaldua alludes to how the “forced cultural penetration” of rape has, so to speak, inseminated white values into the bodies of women of color (1995:143). A Latina woman with lighter skin who does not speak the language of her ancestors is often held suspect by other Latina women and cast out of the community.  Anzaldua attributes this exclusionary practice to an “internalized whiteness that desperately wants boundary lines (this part of me is Mexican, this Indian)[.]” (1995: 143). In opposition to the Enlightenment fantasy of a uniform and self-contained subject, Anzaldua introduces the concept of “mestiza consciousness,” a consciousness of the Borderlands that captures the multiplicity and plurality of Latina consciousness. “From this racial, ideological, cultural and biological cross-pollinization, an ‘alien’ consciousness is presently in the making—a new mestiza consciousness, una conciencia de mujer” (2008: 870). Writing primarily in English but peppering her discussion of mestiza consciousness with phrases in Spanish, Anzaldua puts the non-Spanish reader in an uncomfortable position, paralleling the discomfort felt by many immigrants who are confronted with a language they don’t understand.  In this way, Anzaldua describes and invokes an appreciation of the inner conflict that those straddling two or more cultures, languages, and value systems experience.  She provides a provocative illustration of warring cultures that produce in their subjects a “psychic restlessness” (2008).

The notion of a splintered personality brought on by a collision of cultures is also addressed by Alcoff, who proposes a positive reconstruction of mixed race identities whereby one finds comfort in ambiguity and a contentment with living the “gap” (2000:160). “I never reach shore: I never wholly occupy either the Angla or the Latina identity.  Paradoxically, in white society I feel my Latinness, in Latin society I feel my whiteness, as that which is left out, an invisible present, sometimes as intrusive as an elephant in the room and sometimes more as a pulled thread that alters the design of my fabricated self” (2000:160).

Maria Lugones gives a phenomenological description of what it is like to shift between identities as a person of mixed race or a hyphenated identity.  When voluntarily embraced, she calls this practice of shifting identities “world traveling.”  “Those of us who are ‘world’- travelers have the distinct experience of being different in different ‘worlds’ and ourselves in them” (1995: 396). Lugones’ concept of world traveling arose out of her awareness of the different levels of comfort she experiences in embodying different identities in distinct worlds. In some worlds, Lugones observes she is more playful and not overly concerned with how others view her. However, while inhabiting a world in which her identity is constructed negatively, or strictly on the basis of her ethnicity, she finds she is less playful and may even begin to animate self-defeating stereotypes.

Shifting in and out of various worlds, Lugones advocates a strategy whereby women attempt to empathize with each other by trying to stand in one another’s shoes. Laurence Thomas, to the contrary, warns against such a strategy that asks people who are so differently positioned within society to try to identify with each other’s experiences. Instead, he introduces the model of “moral deference”: “the act of listening that is preliminary to bearing witness to another’s moral pain, but without bearing witness to it” (1986: 377). In this stance, the one suffering has the platform and the one listening, who does not inhabit the same socially constituted identity, cedes the platform by recognizing the incommensurability of his or her experience of the other’s pains and struggles. It is this respect – rooted in an acknowledgment of the irreducibility of lived experience—that is at the heart of Third World Women’s appeal to Western Feminists.

6. Third World Feminisms and Mainstream Feminism in the U.S.

Significantly, the concerns raised by women of color in the U.S. are almost identically replayed by third world women, in what might be called a shift from biological to cultural racism.  However, instead of fighting against a cultural norm of white womanhood, third world feminists are fighting to assert their difference in opposition to a monolithic and dominant notion of Western feminism that is increasingly gaining legitimacy by controlling how women in the third world are represented.

Chandra Talpade Mohanty raises awareness of the impact of Western Scholarship on third world women “in a context of a world system dominated by the West[.]” (1991:53).  She encourages Western feminist scholarship to situate itself within the current Western hegemony over the production, publication, distribution, and consumption of information, and to examine its role within this context (1991:55).   In her analysis of the representations of third world women in nine texts in the Zed Press “Women in the Third World” series, Mohanty finds that in almost all these texts women are monolithically represented as victims of an unchanging patriarchy. These representations uproot women from their lived situations and the practices that shape, and are shaped by them. “The crucial point that is forgotten is that women are produced through these very relations as well as being implicated in forming these relations” (1991:59).

When women’s lives and struggles are not historically and locally situated, they are robbed of their political agency.  Those, then, writing about third world women “become the true ‘subjects’ of this counterhistory” (1991:71).  Western scholarship must, therefore, recognize the ethnocentric universalism it assumes in encoding and representing all third world women as victims of an ahistorical and decontextualized notion of patriarchy that results in a homogenous notion of the oppressed third world women. Only when feminist thinkers examine their role within Western dominations can genuine progress be made.

Uma Narayan highlights the facticity of women’s historical situations in her exposition of the particularities that women in the third world confront in participating in a feminist movement.  Because of the histories of colonialism and imperialism, suspicions against feminist movements as possible instruments of colonial domination surround attempts made by women to organize for change. Specifically, Narayan explores how the term Westernization is used to silence critiques by third world feminists regarding the status and treatment of women in their communities.  Ironically, it is Western educated and assimilated men in the third world that are spearheading these attacks against third world feminists by accusing them of disrespecting their culture and embracing Western values and customs. Narayan rejects the implication that feminism is foreign to the third world, noting that historical and political circumstances that raise awareness of women’s oppression give rise to a feminist consciousness that is organic to third world women’s lives.

Minoo Moallem locates a “feminist imperialism” in Western women’s desire to  enlighten third world women to the civilizing project of the West, wherein first world women become the norm and third world women get constructed as a singular, non-Western other (2006).   Elora Shehabuddin identifies a feminist imperialism in Western women’s attempt to position themselves as the saviors of Muslim women, thereby ignoring women’s voices fighting to make change within the Muslim world  “In presenting change in the Muslim world as possible only with the intervention from the United States—either by force through the violent eradication of oppressive Muslim men or the less dramatic support of ‘moderate’ Muslim groups and individuals—these writers foreclose the possibility of change from within Muslim societies” (2011: 121).

Ignoring the racism inherent in colonialist narratives documenting the oppression of Muslim women by Muslim men, Shehabuddin points out, Western feminists are content to draw on stories of abuse by a few vocal “Muslim escapees” as representative of the victimization of all Muslim women.  What seems to be the primary concern of these Western feminists is not the actual lives of women in the Muslim world, but the assertion of their own moral authority, exercised in presumably righting the sexism in the Islamic world.   In this way, Western feminists repeat and redirect their racism and condescension toward Muslim women and third world women in general, while conveniently avoiding the sexism and oppression in their own backyards.  The remedy to cultural racism is an acknowledgement of it and a commitment to displace Eurocentricism by actually listening to women’s experiences, and engaging women in the hopes of opening up a dialogue.  Shehabuddin writes: “In the end, the only way to find out ‘what Muslim women want’ is to listen to them, not by assuming their needs and concerns are self-evident because they identify as Muslims and not by taking a small group of vocal, articulate individuals—whose opinions on issues like Israel and the war on terror are more acceptable—as the representative and authentic voices” (2011: 132).

7. Conclusion: “There is No Hierarchy of Oppressions”

The history of U.S. feminist thought has evolved from an essentialist notion of womanhood based on the normative model of middle-class white women’s experiences to a recognition that women are, in fact, quite diverse and see themselves differently. “The real problem of feminism,” states Elizabeth Spellman, “is how it has confused the condition of one group of women with the condition of all women” (1988:15 ). In assuming that the experiences of middle-class white women represented the lives of all women, a false unity and solidarity among women was presupposed. Taking account of the multiple and overlapping forms of oppression that many women, especially women of color and third world women must negotiate, reveals the complexity and diversity of women’s lives.  Women of color in the U.S., for example, not only define themselves in a struggle against white men and men of color, but also in resistance to white women.  The same holds for third world women who find themselves fighting against the omission of their experiences and the overarching assumptions made by “first world” feminists regarding their needs and the forms of subordination they confront.  Moving away from a monolithic notion of woman, U.S. feminist theory and practice engages difference by focusing on context-specific positionings of women in relation to other constantly changing categories. But some women worry that without a commonality uniting women the power to make changes will be lost.

To address the complexity of the multitude of oppressions confronting women, Mohanty suggests a model based on “imagined communities of women” organized by “the way we think about race, class, and gender—the political links we choose to make among and between struggles” (1991:4). In these communities, political alliances are formed not by a person’s race or sex, but on the basis of “common contexts of struggle against specific exploitative structures[.]” (1991:7) Today, U.S. mainstream feminism is engaged with recognizing diversity and forming cross-cultural coalitions against injustices. The recognition of difference, however, is not complete without a further commitment to making institutional change.

Like sexism, racism is a problem that is structural and endemic to American culture and needs to be addressed systematically, along with class and all other systems of domination.  As Robert Bernasconi notes, “Personal attitudes are not the main source of the problem and they cannot provide the solution” (2005: 20).  The structural aspect is evident in the ease by which biological racism morphs into cultural racism, spawning condescending and racist attitudes toward third world women and a blindness of first world complicity in various forms of third world oppressions.  Indeed, as Audre Lorde has made clear, “the master’s tools will never dismantle the master’s house.”   However, by waging struggles against systems of domination and exploitation and assuming responsibility to actively give up the privileges bequeathed by these systems, admittedly an uncomfortable proposition, U.S. feminists embark upon dismantling the master’s house and the multitude of oppressions that it sustains.

Still, a change in personal attitudes does go a long way. When mainstream feminists recognize the interconnections between gender, race, nationalism and class, Espiritu writes, “then they can better work with, and not for, women (and men) of color” (Espiritu, 1997: 140).  In sum, feminists in the U.S. have worked arduously to address the question of difference among women, as well as what unites women in common contexts of struggle.   In the early twentieth century, Emma Goldman wrote of the significance of recognizing and respecting differences, while at the same time working together in spite of these differences to challenge institutional inequalities that prevent individuals from living together in a free society.  Goldman laid out a vision for a way forward that goes beyond the mere tolerance of difference when she said: “The problem that confronts us today and which the nearest future is to solve, is how to be one’s self and yet in oneness with the others, to feel deeply with all human beings and still retain one’s own characteristic qualities” (1973: 509).

8. References and Further Reading

  • Alarcon, N.,  “The Theoretical Subject(s) of This Bridge Called My Back and Anglo-American Feminism” in Making Face, Making Soul/Haciendo Caras: Creative and Critical Perspectives by Feminists of Color, (ed.) Anzaldua, G., Aunt Lute Books, 1995.
  • Alcoff, L., “Chapter 9: The Whiteness Question”  Linda Martin-Alcoff, 2005.
  • Alcoff, L., The Idea of Race, (eds.) Bernasconi, R. and Lott,T., Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 2000.
  • Anzaldua, G., “La Conciencia de la Mestiza/Towards a New Consciousness,” in The Feminist Philosophy Reader, (eds.) Bailey, A. and Cuomo, C., New York: McGraw Hill, 2008.
  • Anzaldua, G., “En Rapport, In Opposition: Cobrando cuentas a las neustras,” in Making Face, Making Soul/Haciendo Caras: Creative and Critical Perspectives by Feminists of Color, (ed.) Anzaldua, G., Aunt Lute Books, 1995.
  • Bernasconi, R. “Waking up White and in Memphis” in White on White/Black on Black (ed.) Yancy, G., Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc., 2005.
  • Brooks-Higginbotham, E., “The Problem of Race in Women's History,” in Coming to Terms: Feminism, Theory, Politics, (ed.) Weed, E., New York: Routledge, 1989.
  • Carby, H., “On the Threshold of Woman’s Era: Lynching, Empire, and Sexuality in Black Feminist Theory,” in Race, Writing and Difference, (ed) Gates, H.L, University of Chicago Press: Chicago, 1986.
  • Carby, H., “The Multicultural Wars,” in Black Popular Culture, (ed.) Dent, G., Bay Press: Washington, 1992.
  • Carby, H. Reconstructing Womanhood: The Emergence of the Afro-American Woman Novelist, U.S.A: Oxford University Press, 1989
  • Collins, P.H., Black Feminist Thought, New York: Routledge, 1991.
  • Combahee River Collective, “A Black Feminist Statement The Combahee River Collective” in Words of Fire: An Anthology of African-American Feminist Thought, (ed) Guy-Sheftall, B., New Press, 1995.
  • Davis, A., “Black Nationalism: The Sixties and the Nineties,” in Black Popular Culture, (ed.) Dent, G., Bay Press: Washington, 1992.
  • Espiritu, Yen Le, “Race, Class and Gender in Asian America” in Making More Waves: New Writings by Asian American Women, eds. Elaine H. Kim, Lilia V. Villanueva, and Asian Women United of California, Beacon Press Books: Boston, 1997.
  • Friedan, B. The Feminine Mystique, New York: Dell Publishing Inc., 1974.
  • Frye, M., “White Woman Feminist 1983-1992,” in Race and Racism, (ed.), B. Boxill, U.S.A: Oxford University Press, 2001.
  • de Gobineau, A., "The Inequality of Human Races," in The Idea of Race (eds.) Bernasconi, R. and Lott, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 2000.
  • Goldman, E. “The Tragedy of Woman’s Emancipation,” in The Feminist Papers: From Adams to de Beauvoir, (ed.) Ross, A. S., Boston: Northeastern University Press, 1973.
  • Gordon, L., “On Difference,” Genders 10, Spring 1991.
  • Grande, S., “Whitestream Feminism and the Colonialist Project: A Review of Contemporary Feminist Pedagogy and Praxis,” Educational Theory, Summer 2003,Volume 53, Number 3.
  • Hartsock, Nancy, The Feminist Standpoint Revisited, And Other Essays (Basic Books, 1999), pp. 105-133.
  • Hooks, b., Feminist Theory: From Margin to Center, Boston: South End Press, 1984.
  • Ignatiev, N., “The Point Is Not To Interpret Whiteness But To Abolish It” in Race Traitor, ed. Noel Ignatiev, 1997.
  • Lorde, A. “The Master’s Tools Will Never Dismantle the Master’s House,” in This Bridge Called My Back: Writings by Radical Women of Color, (eds.) Moraga, C. and Anzaldua, Kitchen Table- Women of Color Press, 1984.
  • Lorde, A. “There is No Hierarchy of Oppressions,” Illvox, May 12, 2008.
  • Lugones, M. “Playfulness, ‘World’-Travelling, and Loving Perception” in Making Face, Making Soul/Haciendo Caras: Creative and Critical Perspectives by Feminists of Color, (ed.) Anzaldua, G., Aunt Lute Books, 1995.
  • McIntosh, P., “White Privilege and Male Privlege,” in The Feminist Philosophy Reader, (eds.) Bailey, A. and Cuomo, C., New York: McGraw Hill, 2008.
  • Moallem, M., “Feminist Scholarship and the Internationalization of Women’s Studies,” Feminist Studies 32, no. 2 (Summer 2006) 334
  • Mohanty, C. “Introduction: Cartographies of Struggle: Third World Feminism and the Politics of Feminism” in Third World Women and the Politics of Feminism, (eds.) Mohanty, C., Russo, A., Torres, L., Indiana University Press, 1991.
  • Mohanty, C., “Under Western Eyes: Feminist Scholarship and Colonial Discourses” in Third World Women and the Politics of Feminism, (eds.) Mohanty, C., Russo, A., Torres, L. (eds.) Indiana University Press, 1991.
  • Moraga, C., “From a Long Line of Vendidas: Chicanas and Feminism” in Making Face, Making Soul/Haciendo Caras: Creative and Critical Perspectives by Feminists of Color, (ed.) Anzaldua, G., Aunt Lute Books, 1995.
  • Narayan, U., “Contesting Cultures: ‘Westernization,’ Respect for Cultures and Third-World Feminists,” in The Second Wave: A Reader in Feminist Theory, (ed.) Nicholson, L., New York:Routledge,1997.
  • Ngan Ling Chow, E., “The Development of Feminist Consciousness Among Asian American Women,” in The Social Construction of Gender, (eds.) Lorber, J. and Farrel, S. Sage Publications, 1991.
  • Scott, J., “The Evidence of Experience,” Critical Inquiry 17, 4 (Summer 1991)
  • Shehabuddin, E., “Gender and the Figure of the ‘Moderate Muslim’: Feminism in the Twenty-first Century,’ in Judith Butler and Elizabeth Weed, eds. The Question of Gender: Joan W. Scott's Critical Feminism (Indiana University Press, 2011).
  • Spelman, E., Inessential Woman: Problems of Exclusion in Feminist Thought, Beacon Press: Boston, 1988.
  • Srivastava, S., “You’re calling me a racist? The Moral and Emotional Regulation of Antiracism and Feminism," Signs the Journal of Women in Culture and Society, 2005, vol 31, no. 1  (30, 44, 42-43)
  • Stubblefield, A., “Meditations on Postsupremacist Philosophy” in White on White/Black on Black, G. Yancy (ed.), New York: Rowman &Littlefield, 2005.
  • Thomas, L., Moral Deference, 1998.
  • Truth, S., “Ain’t I A Woman? December 1851,” Internet Modern History Sourcebook, (ed.) Paul Halsal (March 2009).


Author Information

Sharin N. Elkholy
University of Houston – Downtown
U. S. A.

Frantz Fanon (1925—1961)

FrantzfanonpjwproductionsFrantz Fanon was one of a few extraordinary thinkers supporting the decolonization struggles occurring after World War II, and he remains among the most widely read and influential of these voices.  His brief life was notable both for his whole-hearted engagement in the independence struggle the Algerian people waged against France and for his astute, passionate analyses of the human impulse towards freedom in the colonial context.  His written works have become central texts in Africana thought, in large part because of their attention to the roles hybridity and creolization can play in forming humanist, anti-colonial cultures.  Hybridity, in particular, is seen as a counter-hegemonic opposition to colonial practices, a non-assimilationist way of building connections across cultures that Africana scholar Paget Henry argues is constitutive of Africana political philosophy.

Tracing the development of his writings helps explain how and why he has become an inspirational figure firing the moral imagination of people who continue to work for social justice for the marginalized and the oppressed.  Fanon’s first work Peau Noire, Masques Blancs (Black Skin, White Masks) was his first effort to articulate a radical anti-racist humanism that adhered neither to assimilation to a white-supremacist mainstream nor to reactionary philosophies of black superiority.  While the attention to oppression of colonized peoples that was to dominate his later works was present in this first book, its call for a new understanding of humanity was undertaken from the subject-position of a relatively privileged Martinican citizen of France, in search of his own place in the world as a black man from the French Caribbean, living in France.  His later works, notably L’An Cinq, de la Révolution Algérienne (A Dying Colonialism) and the much more well-known Les Damnés de la Terre (The Wretched of the Earth), go beyond a preoccupation with Europe’s pretensions to being a universal standard of culture and civilization, in order to take on the struggles and take up the consciousness of the colonized “natives” as they rise up and reclaim simultaneously their lands and their human dignity.  It is Fanon’s expansive conception of humanity and his decision to craft the moral core of decolonization theory as a commitment to the individual human dignity of each member of populations typically dismissed as “the masses” that stands as his enduring legacy.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Africana Phenomenology
  3. Decolonization Theory
  4. Influences on Fanon’s Thought
  5. Movements and Thinkers Influenced by Fanon
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Frantz Fanon was born in the French colony of Martinique on July 20, 1925.  His family occupied a social position within Martinican society that could reasonably qualify them as part of the black bourgeoisie; Frantz’s father, Casimir Fanon, was a customs inspector and his mother, Eléanore Médélice, owned a hardware store in downtown Fort-de-France, the capital of Martinique.  Members of this social stratum tended to strive for assimilation, and identification, with white French culture.  Fanon was raised in this environment, learning France’s history as his own, until his high school years when he first encountered the philosophy of negritude, taught to him by Aimé Césaire, Martinique’s other renowned critic of European colonization.  Politicized, and torn between the assimilationism of Martinique’s middle class and the preoccupation with racial identity that negritude promotes, Fanon left the colony in 1943, at the age of 18, to fight with the Free French forces in the waning days of World War II.

After the war, he stayed in France to study psychiatry and medicine at university in Lyons.  Here, he encountered bafflingly simplistic anti-black racism—so different from the complex, class-permeated distinctions of shades of lightness and darkness one finds in the Caribbean—which would so enrage him that he was inspired to write “An Essay for the Disalienation of Blacks,” the piece of writing that would eventually become Peau Noire, Masques Blancs (1952).  It was here too that he began to explore the Marxist and existentialist ideas that would inform the radical departure from the assimilation-negritude dichotomy that Peau Noire’s anti-racist humanism inaugurates.

Although he briefly returned to the Caribbean after he finished his studies, he no longer felt at home there and in 1953, after a stint in Paris, he accepted a position as chef de service (chief of staff) for the psychiatric ward of the Blida-Joinville hospital in Algeria.  The following year, 1954, marked the eruption of the Algerian war of independence against France, an uprising directed by the Front de Libération Nationale (FLN) and brutally repressed by French armed forces.  Working in a French hospital, Fanon was increasingly responsible for treating both the psychological distress of the soldiers and officers of the French army who carried out torture in order to suppress anti-colonial resistance and the trauma suffered by the Algerian torture victims.  Already alienated by the homogenizing effects of French imperialism, by 1956 Fanon realized he could not continue to aid French efforts to put down a decolonization movement that commanded his political loyalties, and he resigned his position at the hospital.

Once he was no longer officially working for the French government in Algeria, Fanon was free to devote himself to the cause of Algerian independence.  During this period, he was based primarily in Tunisia where he trained nurses for the FLN, edited its newspaper el Moujahid, and contributed articles about the movement to sympathetic publications, including Presence Africaine and Jean-Paul Sartre’s journal Les Temps Modernes.  Some of Fanon’s writings from this period were published posthumously in 1964 as Pour la Révolution Africaine (Toward the African Revolution).  In 1959 Fanon published a series of essays, L’An Cinq, de la Révolution Algérienne, (The Year of the Algerian Revolution) which detail how the oppressed natives of Algeria organized themselves into a revolutionary fighting force.  That same year, he took up a diplomatic post in the provisional Algerian government, ambassador to Ghana, and used the influence of this position to help open up supply routes for the Algerian army.  It was in Ghana that Fanon was diagnosed with the leukemia that would be his cause of death.  Despite his rapidly failing health, Fanon spent ten months of his last year of life writing the book for which he would be most remembered, Les Damnés de la Terre, an indictment of the violence and savagery of colonialism which he ends with a passionate call for a new history of humanity to be initiated by a decolonized Third World.  In October 1961, Fanon was brought to the United States by a C.I.A. agent so that he could receive treatment at a National Institutes of Health facility in Bethesda, Maryland.  He died two months later, on December 6, 1961, reportedly still preoccupied with the cause of liberty and justice for the peoples of the Third World. At the request of the FLN, his body was returned to Tunisia, where it was subsequently transported across the border and buried in the soil of the Algerian nation for which he fought so single-mindedly during the last five years of his life.

2. Africana Phenomenology

Fanon’s contribution to phenomenology, glossed as a critical race discourse (an analysis of the pre-conscious forces shaping the self that organizes itself around race as a founding category), most particularly his exploration of the existential challenges faced by black human beings in a social world that is constituted for white human beings, receives its most explicit treatment in Peau Noire, Masques Blancs.  The central metaphor of this book, that black people must wear “white masks” in order to get by in a white world, is reminiscent of W.E.B. Du Bois’ argument that African Americans develop a double consciousness living under a white power structure: one that flatters that structure (or some such) and one experienced when among other African Americans.  Fanon’s treatment of the ways black people respond to a social context that racializes them at the expense of our shared humanity ranges across a broader range of cultures than Du Bois, however; Fanon examines how race shapes (deforms) the lives of both men and women in the French Caribbean, in France, and in colonial conflicts in Africa.  Africana sociologist Paget Henry characterizes Fanon’s relation to Du Bois in the realm of phenomenology as one of extension and of clarification, since he offers a more detailed investigation of how the self encounters the trauma of being categorized by others as inferior due to an imposed racial identity and how that self can recuperate a sense of identity and a cultural affiliation that is independent of the racist project of an imperializing dominant culture.

Fanon dissects in all of his major works the racist and colonizing project of white European culture, that is, the totalizing, hierarchical worldview that needs to set up the black human being as “negro” so it has an “other” against which to define itself.  While Peau Noire offers a sustained discussion of the psychological dimensions of this “negrification” of human beings and possibilities of resistance to it, the political dimensions are explored in L’An Cinq, de la Révolution Algérienne and Les Damnés de la Terre.  Fanon’s diagnosis of the psychological dimensions of negrification’s phenomenological violence documents its traumatizing effects: first, negrification promotes negative attitudes toward other blacks and Africa; second, it normalizes attitudes of desire and debasement toward Europe, white people, and white culture in general; and finally, it presents itself as such an all-encompassing way of being in the world that no other alternative appears to be possible.  The difficulty of overcoming the sense of alienation that negrification sets up as necessary for the black human being lies in learning to see oneself not just as envisioned and valued (that is, devalued) by the white dominant culture but simultaneously through a perspective constructed both in opposition to and independently from the racist/racialized mainstream, a parallel perspective in which a black man or woman’s value judgments—of oneself and of others of one’s race—do not have to be filtered through white norms and values.  It is only through development of this latter perspective that the black man or woman can shake off the psychological colonization that racist phenomenology imposes, Fanon argues.

One of the most pervasive agents of phenomenological conditioning is language.  In Peau Noire, Fanon analyzes language as that which carries and reveals racism in culture, using as an example the symbolism of whiteness and blackness in the French language—a point that translates equally well into English linguistic habits.  One cannot learn and speak this language, Fanon asserts, without subconsciously accepting the cultural meanings embedded in equations of purity with whiteness and malevolence with blackness: to be white is to be good, and to be black is to be bad.  While Peau Noire focuses on the colonizing aspects of the French language, L’An Cinq, on the other hand, offers an interesting account of how language might enable decolonization efforts.  Fanon describes a decision made by the revolutionary forces in Algeria in 1956 to give up their previous boycott of French and instead start using it as the lingua franca that could unite diverse communities of resistance, including those who did not speak Arabic.  The subversive effects of adopting French extended beyond the convenience of a common language; it also cast doubt on the simplistic assumption the French colonizers had been making, namely, that all French speakers in Algeria were loyal to the colonial government.  After strategically adopting the colonizer’s language, one entered a shop or a government office no longer necessarily announcing one’s politics in one’s choice of language.

Fanon’s critical race phenomenology is not without its critics, many of whom read Peau Noire’s back-to-back accounts of the black woman’s desire for a white lover and the black man’s desire for a white lover as misogynistic.  According to these critiques, typically offered from a feminist point of view, the autobiography of Mayotte Capécia, a Martinican woman who seeks the love of a white man, any white man it seems, is treated by Fanon (who describes it as “cut-rate” and “ridiculous”) with far less respect than the novel by René Maran, which describes the story of Jean Veneuse, a black man who reluctantly falls in love with a white Frenchwoman and hesitates to marry her until he is urged to do so by her brother.  Although Fanon is unequivocal in his statement that both of these discussions serve as examples of “alienated psyches,” white feminists who make this charge of misogyny point to his less sympathetic account of Capécia as evidence that he holds black women complicit in the devaluing of blackness.  Where it is found at all in the work of black feminist writers, this allegation tends to be more tentative, and tends to be contextualized within a pluralist inventory of phenomenological approaches.  Just as Fanon selects race as the founding category of phenomenology, a feminist phenomenology would focus on gender as a founding category.  In this pluralist framework, Fanon’s attention to race at the expense of gender is arguably more explicable as a methodological choice than a deep-seated contempt for women.

3. Decolonization Theory

The political dimensions of negrification that call for decolonization receive fuller treatment in L’An Cinq, de la Révolution Algérienne and Les Damnés de la Terre.  But Fanon does not simply diagnose the political symptoms of the worldview within which black men and women are dehumanized.  He situates his diagnosis within an unambiguous ethical commitment to the equal right of every human being to have his or her human dignity recognized by others.  This assertion, that all of us are entitled to moral consideration and that no one is dispensable, is the principled core of his decolonization theory, which continues to inspire scholars and activists dedicated to human rights and social justice.

As the French title suggests, L’An Cinq (published in English as A Dying Colonialism) is Fanon’s first-hand account of how the Algerian people mobilized themselves into a revolutionary fighting force and repelled the French colonial government.  The lessons that other aspiring revolutionary movements can learn from Fanon’s presentation of the FLN’s strategies and tactics are embedded in their particular Algerian context, but nonetheless evidently adaptable.  In addition to describing the FLN’s strategic adoption of French as the language of communication with its sympathetic civilian population, Fanon also traces the interplay of ideological and pragmatic choices they made about communications technology.  Once the French started suppressing newspapers, the FLN had to rethink their standing boycott of radios, which they had previously denounced as the colonizer’s technology.  This led to the creation of a nationalist radio station, the Voice of Fighting Algeria, that now challenged colonial propaganda with what Fanon described as “the first words of the nation.”  Another of the fundamental challenges they issued to the colonial world of division and hierarchy was the radically inclusive statement the provisional government made that all people living in Algeria would be considered citizens of the new nation.  This was a bold contestation of European imperialism on the model of Haiti’s first constitution (1805), which attempted to break down hierarchies of social privilege based on skin color by declaring that all Haitian citizens would be considered black.  Both the Algerian and Haitian declarations are powerful decolonizing moves because they undermine the very Manichean structure that Fanon identifies as the foundation of the colonial world.

While L’An Cinq offers the kinds of insights one might hope for from a historical document, Les Damnés de la Terre is a more abstract analysis of colonialism and revolution.  It has been described as a handbook for black revolution.  The book ranges over the necessary role Fanon thinks violence must play in decolonization struggles, the false paths decolonizing nations take when they entrust their eventual freedom to negotiations between a native elite class and the formers colonizers instead of mobilizing the masses as a popular fighting force, the need to recreate a national culture through a revolutionary arts and literature movement, and an inventory of the psychiatric disorders that colonial repression unleashes.  Part of its shocking quality, from a philosophical perspective, is alluded to in the preface that Jean-Paul Sartre wrote for the book: it speaks the language of philosophy and deploys the kind of Marxist and Hegelian arguments one might expect in a philosophy of liberation, but it does not speak to the West.  It is Fanon conversing with, advising, his fellow Third-World revolutionaries.

The controversy that swirls around Les Damnés is very different from the one Peau Noire attracts.  Where feminist critiques of Peau Noire require a deep reading and an analysis of the kinds of questions Fanon failed to ask, those who find fault with Les Damnés for what they see as its endorsement of violent insurgency are often reading Fanon’s words too simplistically.   His argument is not that decolonizing natives are justified in using violent means to effect their ends;  the point he is making in his opening chapter, “Concerning Violence,” is that violence is a fundamental element of colonization, introduced by the colonizers and visited upon the colonized as part of the colonial oppression.  The choice concerning violence that the colonized native must make, in Fanon’s view, is between continuing to accept it—absorbing the abuse or displacing it upon other members of the oppressed native community—or taking this foreign violence and throwing it back in the face of those who initiated it.  Fanon’s consistent existentialist commitment to choosing one’s character through one’s actions means that decolonization can only happen when the native takes up his or her responsible subjecthood and refuses to occupy the position of violence-absorbing passive victim.

4. Influences on Fanon’s Thought

The first significant influence on Fanon was the philosophy of negritude to which he was introduced by Aimé Césaire.  Although this philosophy of black pride was a potent counterbalance to the assimilation tendencies into which Fanon had been socialized, it was ultimately an inadequate response to an imperializing culture that presents itself as a universal worldview.  Far more fruitful, in Fanon’s view, were his studies in France of Hegel, Marx, and Husserl.  From these sources he developed the view that dialectic could be the process through which the othered/alienated self can respond to racist trauma in a healthy way, a sensitivity to the social and economic forces that shape human beings, and an appreciation for the pre-conscious construction of self that phenomenology can reveal.  He also found Sartre’s existentialism a helpful resource for theorizing the process of self construction by which each of us chooses to become the persons we are.  This relation with Sartre appears to have been particularly mutually beneficial; Sartre’s existentialism permeates Peau Noire and in turn, Sartre’s heartfelt and radical commitment to decolonization suggests that Fanon had quite an influence on him.

5. Movements and Thinkers Influenced by Fanon

The pan-Africanism that Fanon understood himself to be contributing to in his work on behalf of Third World peoples never really materialized as a political movement.  It must be remembered that in Fanon’s day, the term “Third World” did not have the meaning it has today.  Where today it designates a collection of desperately poor countries that are the objects of the developed world’s charity, in the 1950s and 1960s, the term indicated the hope of an emerging alternative to political alliance with either the First World (the United States and Europe) or the Second World (the Soviet bloc).  The attempt to generate political solidarity and meaningful political power among the newly independent nations of Africa instead foundered as these former colonies fell victim to precisely the sort of false decolonization and client-statism that Fanon had warned against.  Today, as a political program, that ideal of small-state solidarity survives only in the leftist critiques of neoliberalism offered by activists like Noam Chomsky and Naomi Klein.

Instead, the discourse of solidarity and political reconstruction has retreated into the academy, where it is theorized as “postcolonialism.”  Here we find the critical theorizing of scholars like Edward Said and Gayatri Spivak, both of whom construct analyses of the colonial Self and the colonized Other that, implicitly at least, depend on the Manichean division that Fanon presents in Les Damnés.

Thinkers around the globe have been profoundly influenced by Fanon’s work on anti-black racism and decolonization theory.  Brazilian theorist of critical pedagogy Paulo Freire engages Fanon in dialogue in Pedagogy of the Oppressed, notably in his discussion of the mis-steps that oppressed people may make on their path to liberation.  Freire’s emphasis on the need to go beyond a mere turning of the tables, a seizure of the privileges and social positions of the oppressors, echoes Fanon’s concern in Les Damnés and in essays such as “Racism and Culture” (in Pour la Révolution Africaine) that failure to appreciate the deeply Manichean structure of the settler-native division could lead to a false decolonization in which a native elite simply replace the settler elite as the oppressive rulers of the still exploited masses.  This shared concern is the motivation for Freire’s insistence on perspectival transformation and on populist inclusion as necessary conditions for social liberation.

Kenyan author and decolonization activist Ngũgĩ wa Thiong’o also draws on ideas Fanon presents in Les Damnés.  Inspired mainly by Fanon’s meditations on the need to decolonize national consciousness, Ngũgĩ has written of the need to get beyond the “colonization of the mind” that occurs in using the language of imposed powers.  Like Fanon, he recognizes that language has a dual character.  It colonizes in the sense that power congeals in the history of how language is used (that is, its role in carrying culture). But it can also be adapted to our real-life communication and our “image-forming” projects, which means it also always carries the potential to be the means by which we liberate ourselves.  Ngũgĩ’s last book in English, Decolonizing the Mind, was his official renunciation of the colonizer’s language in favor of his native tongue, Gĩkũyũ, and its account of the politics of language in African literature can fruitfully be read as an illustration of the abstract claims Fanon makes about art and culture in Les Damnés and Pour la Révolution Africaine.

Maori scholar Linda Tuhiwai Smith takes up Fanon’s call for artists and intellectuals of decolonizing societies to create new literatures and new cultures for their liberated nations.  Applying Fanon’s call to her own context, Tuhiwai Smith notes that Maori writers in New Zealand have begun to produce literature that reflects and supports a resurgent indigenous sovereignty movement, but she notes that there is little attention to achieving that same intellectual autonomy in the social sciences.  Inspired by Fanon’s call to voice, she has written Decolonizing Methodologies, a book that interrogates the way “research” has been used by European colonial powers to subjugate indigenous peoples and also lays out methodological principles for indigenous research agendas that will not reproduce the same dehumanizing results that colonial knowledge production has been responsible for

In the United States, Fanon’s influence continues to grow.  Feminist theorist bell hooks, one of those who notes the absence of attention to gender in Fanon’s work, nonetheless acknowledges the power of his vision of the resistant decolonized subject and the possibility of love that this vision nurtures.  Existential phenomenologist Lewis R. Gordon works to articulate the new humanism that Fanon identified as the goal of a decolonized anti-racist philosophy.  Gordon is one of the Africana--and Caribbean--focused scholars in American academia who has been involved in founding today’s most prominent Africana-Caribbean research network, the Caribbean Philosophical Association, which awards an annual book prize in Frantz Fanon’s name.  The Frantz Fanon Prize recognizes excellence in scholarship that advances Caribbean philosophy and Africana-humanist thought in the Fanonian tradition.

In Paris, the heart of the former empire that Fanon opposed so vigorously in his short life, his philosophy of humanist liberation and his commitment to the moral relevance of all people everywhere have been taken up by his daughter Mireille Fanon.  She heads the Fondation Frantz Fanon and follows in her father’s footsteps with her work on questions of international law and human rights, supporting the rights of migrants, and championing struggles against the impunity of the powerful and all forms of racism.


6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Fanon, Frantz.  L’An Cinq, de la Révolution Algérienne.  Paris: François Maspero, 1959.  [Published in English as A Dying Colonialism, trans. Haakon Chevalier (New York: Grove Press, 1965).]
  • Fanon, Frantz.  Les Damnés de la Terre.  Paris: François Maspero, 1961.  [Published in English as The Wretched of the Earth, trans. Constance Farrington (New York: Grove Press, 1965).]
  • Fanon, Frantz.  Peau Noire, Masques Blancs.  Paris: Editions du Seuil, 1952.  [Published in English as Black Skin, White Masks, trans. Charles Lam Markmann (New York: Grove Press, 1967).]
  • Fanon, Frantz.  Pour la Révolution Africaine.  Paris: François Maspero, 1964.  [Published in English as Toward the African Revolution, trans. Haakon Chevalier (New York: Grove Press, 1967).]

b. Secondary Sources

  • Cherki, Alice.  Frantz Fanon: A Portrait.  Trans. Nadia Benabid.  Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 2006.
    • A biography of Fanon by one of his co-workers at the Blida-Joinville hospital in Algeria and fellow activists for Algerian liberation.
  • Gibson, Nigel C.  Fanon: The Postcolonial Imagination.  Cambridge, UK: Polity Press, 2003.
    • An introduction to Fanon’s ideas with emphasis on the role that dialectic played in his development of a philosophy of liberation.
  • Gibson, Nigel C. (ed.).  Rethinking Fanon: The Continuing Dialogue.  Amherst, NY: Humanity Books, 1999.
    • A collection of some of the enduring essays on Fanon, with attention to his continuing relevance.
  • Gordon, Lewis R.  Fanon and the Crisis of European Man: An Essay on Philosophy and the Human Sciences.  New York: Routledge, 1995.
    • An argument in the Fanonian vein that bad faith in European practice of the human sciences has impeded the inclusive humanism Fanon called for.
  • Gordon, Lewis R., T. Denean Sharpley-Whiting, and Renée T. White (eds.).  Fanon: A Critical Reader.  Malden, MA: Blackwell, 1996.
    • Essays on Africana philosophy, neocolonial and postcolonial studies, human sciences, and other academic discourses that place Fanon’s work in its appropriate and illuminating contexts.
  • Hoppe, Elizabeth A. and Tracey Nicholls (eds.).  Fanon and the Decolonization of Philosophy.  Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2010.
    • Essays by contemporary Fanon scholars exploring the enduring relevance to philosophy of Fanon’s thought.
  • Sekyi-Out, Ato.  Fanon’s Dialectic of Experience.  Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1996.
    • A hermeneutic reading of all of Fanon’s texts as a single dialectical narrative.
  • Zahar, Renate.  Frantz Fanon: Colonialism and Alienation.  New York: Monthly Review Press, 1974.
    • An analysis of Fanon’s writings through the concept of alienation.


Author Information

Tracey Nicholls
Lewis University
U. S. A.

Augustine: Political and Social Philosophy

augustineSt. Augustine (354-430 C.E.), originally named Aurelius Augustinus, was the Catholic bishop of Hippo in northern Africa.  He was a skilled Roman-trained rhetorician, a prolific writer (who produced more than 110 works over a 30-year period), and by wide acclamation, the first Christian philosopher.  Writing from a unique background and vantage point as a keen observer of society before the fall of the Roman Empire, Augustine’s views on political and social philosophy constitute an important intellectual bridge between late antiquity and the emerging medieval world.  Because of the scope and quantity of his work, many scholars consider him to have been the most influential Western philosopher.

Although Augustine certainly would not have thought of himself as a political or social philosopher per se, the record of his thoughts on such themes as the nature of human society, justice, the nature and role of the state, the relationship between church and state, just and unjust war, and peace all have played their part in the shaping of Western civilization. There is much in his work that anticipates major themes in the writings of moderns like Machiavelli, Luther, Calvin and, in particular, Hobbes.

Table of Contents

  1. Background
    1. Historical Context
    2. Augustinian Political “Theory”
    3. The Augustinian World View
  2. Foundational Political and Social Concepts
    1. Two Cities
    2. Justice and the State
    3. Church and State
  3. War and Peace
    1. War Among Nations
    2. War and Human Nature
    3. The Just War
    4. Jus ad Bellum and Jus in Bello
    5. Augustine’s Conception of Peace
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Background

a. Historical Context

Augustine’s political and social views flow directly from his theology.  The historical context is essential to understanding his purposes.  Augustine, more than any other figure of late antiquity, stands at the intellectual intersection of Christianity, philosophy, and politics.  As a Christian cleric, he takes it as his task to defend his flock against the unremitting assault by heresies spawned in an era uninformed by the immediate, divine revelations which had characterized the apostolic age. As a philosopher, he situates his arguments against the backdrop of Greek philosophy in the Platonic tradition, particularly as formulated by the Neo-Platonists of Alexandria.  As a prominent Roman citizen, he understands the Roman Empire to be the divinely-ordained medium through which the truths of Christianity are to be both spread and safeguarded.

Augustine died reciting the Penitential Psalms as the Vandals besieged the city of Hippo on the coast of northern Africa (now the city of Annaba, in Algeria). This occurred two decades after the sacking of Rome by Alaric.

b. Augustinian Political “Theory”

Augustine’s willingness to grapple with substantive political and social issues does not mean, however, that the presentation of his ideas comes pre-packaged as a simple system—or even as a system at all.  Quite the contrary, his political arguments are scattered throughout his voluminous writings, which include autobiography, sermons, expositions, commentaries, letters, and Christian apologetics.  Moreover, the contexts in which the political and social issues are addressed are equally varied.

Nevertheless, it would be a mistake to suggest that his arguments are not informed by a cogent theory.  Taken together, his political and social musings constitute a remarkable tapestry.  Indeed, the consistency evident in the expression of his varied but related ideas leads both fairly and directly to the assumption that Augustine’s political-philosophical statements arise from a consistent set of premises which guide him to his conclusions; in other words, they reveal the presence of an underlying, if unstated, theory.

c. The Augustinian World View

Because Augustine considers the Christian scriptures to constitute the touchstone against which philosophy—including political philosophy—must be assayed, his world view necessarily includes the Christian tenets of the Creation, the Fall of man, and the Redemption.  In stark contrast to the pagan philosophers who preceded him—who viewed the unfolding of history as a cyclical phenomenon, Augustine conceives history in strictly linear terms, with a beginning and an end.  According to Augustine, the earth was brought into existence ex nihilo by a perfectly good and just God, who created man. The earth is not eternal; the earth, as well as time, has both a beginning and an end.

Man, on the other hand, was brought into existence to endure eternally. Damnation is the just desert of all men because of the Fall of Adam, who, having been created with free will, chose to disrupt the perfectly good order established by God. As the result of Adam’s Fall, all human beings are heirs to the effects of Adam’s original sin, and all are vessels of pride, avarice, greed and self-interest.  For reasons known only to God, He has predestined some fixed number of men for salvation (as a display of His unmerited mercy—a purely gratuitous act altogether independent even of God’s foreknowledge of any good deeds those men might do while on earth), while most He has predestined for damnation as a just consequence of the Fall. The onward march of human history, then, constitutes the unfolding of the divine plan which will culminate in one or the other outcome for every member of the human family.

Within this framework of political and legal systems, the state is a divinely ordained punishment for fallen man, with its armies, its power to command, coerce, punish, and even put to death, as well as its institutions such as slavery and private property. God shapes the ultimate ends of man’s existence through it.  The state simultaneously serves the divine purposes of chastening the wicked and refining the righteous.  Also simultaneously, the state constitutes a sort of remedy for the effects of the Fall, in that it serves to maintain such modicum of peace and order as it is possible for fallen man to enjoy in the present world.

While it is not clear that God predestines every event during man’s sojourn on earth, nothing happens in contravention of His designs. In any case, predestination fixes the ultimate destination of every human being—as well as the political states to which they belong.  Hence, predestination for Augustine is the proverbial elephant in the room. Whether predestination was divinely contemplated prior or incidental to the Fall (a point which Augustine never clearly articulates), the following problem arises:  If one is to be saved or damned by divine fiat, what difference does it make whether the world possesses the social order of a state?  For those who are predestined for damnation, what is the point of their being “chastened” (or a means to encourage their reformation) by the state?  For those predestined for salvation, what is the point of their being refined by the vicissitudes of life in a political state?  In order to prevent the collapse of such a systematic account of the human condition as Augustine provides, the question simply must be set aside as a matter unknowable to finite man.  However, this means that the best Augustine can hope to accomplish is to provide a description of political life on earth, but not a prescription for how to obtain membership in the perfect society of heaven; for, even strict obedience to Christian precepts will not compensate for one’s not being gratuitously elected for salvation.

As the social fabric of the world around him unravels in the twilight years of the Roman Empire, Augustine attempts to elucidate the relationship between the eternal, invisible verities of his faith and the stark realities of the present, observable political and social conditions of humanity.  At the intersection of these two concerns, Augustine finds what for him is the central question of politics:  How do the faithful operate successfully but justly in an unjust world, , where selfish interests dominate, where the general welfare is rarely sought, and where good and evil men are inextricably (and, to human eyes, often unidentifiably) intermingled, yet search for a heavenly reward in the world hereafter?

2. Foundational Political and Social Concepts

a. Two Cities

Even though those elected for salvation and those elected for damnation are thoroughly intermingled, the distinction arising from their respective destinies gives rise to two classes of persons, to whom Augustine refers collectively and allegorically as cities—the City of God and the earthly city.  Citizens of the earthly city are the unregenerate progeny of Adam and Eve, who are justifiably damned because of Adam’s Fall.  These persons, according to Augustine, are aliens to God’s love (not because God refuses to love them, but because they refuse to love God as evidenced by their rebellious disposition inherited from the Fall).  Indeed, the object of their love—whatever it may be—is something other than God.  In particular, citizens of the “earthly city” are distinguished by their lust for material goods and for domination over others.  On the other hand, citizens of the City of God are “pilgrims and foreigners” who (because God, the object of their love, is not immediately available for their present enjoyment) are very much out of place in a world without an earthly institution sufficiently similar to the City of God.  No political state, nor even the institutional church, can be equated with the City of God.  Moreover, there is no such thing as “dual citizenship” in the two cities; every member of the human family belongs to one—and only one.

b. Justice and the State

The Augustinian notion of justice includes what by his day was a well-established definition of justice of “giving every man his due.”  However, Augustine grounds his application of the definition in distinctively Christian philosophical commitments:  “justice,” says Augustine, “is love serving God only, and therefore ruling well all else.”  Accordingly, justice becomes the crucial distinction between ideal political states (none of which actually exist on earth) and non-ideal political states—the status of every political state on earth.  For example, the Roman Empire could not be synonymous with the City of God precisely because it lacked true justice as defined above; and since, “where there is no justice there is no commonwealth,” Rome could not truly be a commonwealth, that is, an ideal state.  “Remove justice,” Augustine asks rhetorically, “and what are kingdoms but gangs of criminals on a large scale?  What are criminal gangs but petty kingdoms?”  No earthly state can claim to possess true justice, but only some relative justice by which one state is more just than another.  Likewise, the legitimacy of any earthly political regime can be understood only in relative terms:  The emperor and the pirate have equally legitimate domains if they are equally just.

Nevertheless, political states, imperfect as they are,  serve a divine purpose.  At the very least, they serve as vehicles for maintaining order and for preventing what Hobbes will later call the “war of all against all.”  In that respect, the state is a divine gift and an expression of divine mercy—especially if the state is righteously ruled.  The state maintains order by keeping wicked men in check through the fear of punishment.  Although God will eventually punish the sins of all those elected for damnation, He uses the state to levy more immediate punishments against both the damned and the saved (or against the wicked and the righteous, the former dichotomy not necessarily synonymous with the latter).  Rulers, as God’s ministers, punish the guilty and always are justified in punishing sins “against nature,” and circumstantially justified in punishing sins “against custom” or “against the laws.” The latter two categories of sins change from time to time.  In this regard, the institution of the state marks a relative return to order from the chaos of the Fall.  Rulers have the right to establish any law that does not conflict with the law of God. Citizens have the duty to obey their political leaders regardless of whether the leader is wicked or righteous.  There is no right of civil disobedience.  Citizens are always duty bound to obey God; and when the imperatives of obedience to God and obedience to civil authority conflict, citizens must choose to obey God and willingly accept the punishment of disobedience. Nevertheless, those empowered to levy punishment should take no delight in the task.  For example, the prayer of the judge who condemns a man to death should be, as Augustine’s urges, “From my necessities [of imposing judgment to a person] deliver thou me.”

c. Church and State

Even though the ostensible reason for the state’s divinely appointed existence is to assist and bless humankind, there is no just state, says Augustine, because men reject the thing that best could bring justice to an imperfect world, namely, the teachings of Christ.  Augustine does not suggest that current rejection of Christ’s teachings means that all hope for future amendment and reformation is lost.  However, Augustine’s whole tenor is that there is no reason to expect that the political jurisdictions of this world ever will be anything different than what they now are, if the past is any predictor of the future.  Hence, Augustine concludes that

Christ’s servants, whether they are kings, or princes, or judges, or soldiers . . . are bidden, if need be, to endure the wickedness of an utterly corrupt state, and by that endurance to win for themselves a place of glory . . . in the Heavenly Commonwealth, whose law is the will of God.

Augustine clearly holds that the establishment and success of the Roman Empire, along with its embracing of Christianity as its official religion, was part of the divine plan of the true God.  Indeed, he holds that the influence of Christianity upon the empire could be only salutary in its effect:

Were our religion listened to as it deserves,” says Augustine, “it would establish, consecrate, strengthen, and enlarge the commonwealth in a way beyond all that Romulus, Numa, Brutus, and all the other men of renown in Roman history achieved.

Still, while Augustine doubtless holds that it is better for Rome to be Christian than not, he clearly recognizes that officially embracing Christianity does not automatically transform an earthly state into the City of God.  Indeed, he regards Rome as “a kind of second Babylon.”  Even if the Roman Emperor and the Roman Pontiff were one and the same—even if the structures of state and church merged so as to become institutionally the same—they would not thereby become the City of God, because citizenship in the City of God is determined at the individual and not the institutional level.

Augustine does not wish ill for Rome.  Quite the contrary, he supplicates God for Rome’s welfare,  since he belongs to it, in temporal terms at least.  He sees Rome as the last bastion against the advances of the pagan barbarians, who surely must not be allowed to overrun the mortal embodiment of Christendom that Rome represents.  Nevertheless, Augustine cannot be overly optimistic about the future of the Roman state as such—not because it is Rome, but because it is a state; for any society of men other than the City of God is part and parcel of the earthly city, which is doomed to inevitable demise.  Even so, states like Rome can perform the useful purpose of championing the cause of the Church, protecting it from assault and compelling those who have fallen away from fellowship with it to return to the fold.  Indeed, it is entirely within the provinces of the state to punish heretics and schismatics.

3. War and Peace

a. War Among Nations

Inasmuch as the history of human society is largely the history of warfare, it seems quite natural for Augustine to explain war as being within God’s unfolding plan for human history.  As Augustine states, “It rests with the decision of God in his just judgment and mercy either to afflict or console mankind, so that some wars come to an end more speedily, others more slowly.”

Wars serve the function of putting mankind on notice, as it were, of the value of consistently righteous living.  Although one might feel to call upon Augustine to defend the notion that God can, with propriety, use so terrible a vehicle as war to chasten the wicked, two points must be kept in mind:  The first point is that, for Augustine, all of God’s acts are just, by definition, even if the application of that definition to specific cases of the human experience eludes human reasoning.             This point invites a somewhat more philosophically intriguing question:  Is it just to compel men to do good who, when left to their own devices, would prefer evil?  If one were forced to act righteously contrary to his or her will, is it not the case that he or she would still lack the change of heart that is necessary to produce a repentant attitude—an attitude that results in genuine reformation?  Perhaps; but Augustine is unwilling to concede that it is better, in the name of recognizing the agency of others, to let them continue to wallow in evil practices.  Augustine argues,

The aim towards which a good will compassionately devotes its efforts is to secure that a bad will be rightly directed.  For who does not know that a man is not condemned on any other ground than because his bad will deserved it, and that no man is saved who has not a good will?

Exactly how God is to bring about his good purposes through the process of war may not be clear to man in any particular case.  Any who acquire a glimpse of understanding as to why the divine economy operates as it does truly possess a good will and shall not hesitate to administer to those erring, according to God’s direction, the punitive discipline that war is intended to bring.  Moreover, those of good will shall administer discipline to those erring by moving them toward repentance and reformation.

All of this leads conveniently to a second point: War can bring the need to discipline by chastening. Those of good will do not manifest cruelty in the proper administration of punishment but, rather, in the withholding of punishment.  “It does not follow,” Augustine states, “that those who are loved should be cruelly left to yield themselves with impunity to their bad will; but in so far as power is given, they ought to be both prevented from evil and compelled to good.”  What if, however, the violence of war serves only to subdue the wrongdoings of the wicked but fails to produce the change of heart that would characterize the transition from a bad to a good will—much like the case of the criminal who is sentenced to prison but who feels no remorse for his or her actions and, given his or her freedom, would all too readily repeat the crime?  For Augustine, it is always better to restrain an evil man from the commission of evil acts than it is to permit his continued perpetration of those acts.  As for the evil but unrepentant man, it would seem that he will have failed to reap the intended benefit of God’s chastening, which, reckoned by any measure, is a great tragedy indeed.

For Augustine, even the death of the mortal body, as ultimate a penalty as it might appear from the mortal perspective, is not nearly so serious a consequence as that which would ensue if one is left to wallow in sin: “But great and holy men, although they at the time knew excellently well that that death which separates the soul from the body is not to be dreaded, yet, in accordance with the sentiment of those who might fear it, punished some sins with death, both because the living were struck with a salutary fear, and because it was not death itself that would injure those who were being punished with death, but sin, which might be increased if they continued to live.”

Writing after the time when Christianity became the official religion of the Roman Empire, Augustine holds that there is no prohibition against a Christian serving the state as a soldier in its army.  Neither is there any prohibition against taking the lives of the enemies of the state, so long as he does it in his public capacity as a soldier and not in the private capacity of a murderer.  Nevertheless, Augustine also urges that soldiers should go to war mournfully and never take delight in the shedding of blood.

b. War and Human Nature

If, however, the presence of war serves as a defining characteristic of the earthly city, why does Augustine not pursue the course taken by some of the Latin Patristic writers who precede him by labeling war and military service as merely a “worldly” institution in which true Christians have no place.  The answer seems to lie in Augustine’s world view, which differs from that of many of his predecessors in terms of his optimism for man to comprehend the ultimate verities, live in an orderly manner and find his way back to God.  He becomes quite pessimistic though in his view of human nature and of the ability and desire of humans to maintain themselves orderly, much less rightly.  Pride, vanity and the lust for domination entice men toward waging wars and committing all manner of violence, because of men’s tendency to do evil as the result of Adam’s Fall.  Augustine holds that, given the inextricable mixing of citizens of the two cities, the total avoidance of war or its effects is a practical impossibility for all men, including the righteous.  Happily, he holds that the day will come when, coincident with the end of the earthly city, wars will no longer be fought.  For, says Augustine, citing words from the Psalms to the effect that God will one day bring a cessation of all wars,

This not yet see we fulfilled:  yet are there wars, wars among nations for sovereignty; among sects, among Jews, Pagans, Christians, heretics, are wars, frequent wars, some for the truth, some for falsehood contending.  Not yet then is this fulfilled, ‘He maketh wars to cease unto the end of the earth;’ but haply it shall be fulfilled.

For the present, however, man—particularly Christian man—is left with the question of how to live in a world full of war.

c. The Just War

As the Roman Empire collapses around him, Augustine confronted the question of what justifies warfare for a Christian.  On the one hand, the wicked are not particularly concerned about just wars.  On the other hand, the righteous vainly hope to avoid being affected by wars in this life,   and at best they can hope for just wars rather than unjust ones.   This is by no means a perfect solution; but then again, this is not a perfect world.  If it were, all talk of just wars would be altogether nonsensical. Perfect solutions characterize only the heavenly City of God. Its pilgrim citizens sojourning on earth can do no better than try to cope with the present difficulties and imperfections of the earthly life.  Thus, for Augustine, the just war is a coping mechanism for use by the righteous who aspire to citizenship in the City of God.  In terms of the traditional notion of jus ad bellum (justice of war, that is, the circumstances in which wars can be justly fought), war is a coping mechanism for righteous sovereigns who would ensure that their violent international encounters are minimal, a reflection of the Divine Will to the greatest extent possible, and always justified.  In terms of the traditional notion of jus in bello (justice in war, or the moral considerations which ought to constrain the use of violence in war), war is a coping mechanism for righteous combatants who, by divine edict, have no choice but to subject themselves to their political masters and seek to ensure that they execute their war-fighting duty as justly as possible. Sometimes that duty might arise in the most trying of circumstances, or under the most wicked of regimes; for

Christ’s servants, whether they are kings, or princes, or judges, or soldiers, or provincials, whether rich or poor, freemen or slaves, men or women, are bidden, if need be, to endure the wickedness of an utterly corrupt state, and by that endurance to win for themselves a place of glory

hereafter in the heavenly City of God.

In sum, why would a man like Augustine, whose eye is fixed upon attainment of citizenship in the heavenly city, find it necessary to delineate what counts as a just war in this lost and fallen world?  In general terms, the demands of moral life are so thoroughly interwoven with social life that the individual cannot be separated from citizenship in one or the other city.  In more specific terms, the just man who walks by faith needs to understand how to cope with the injustices and contradictions of war as much as he needs to understand how to cope with all other aspects of the present world where he is a stranger and pilgrim.  Augustine takes important cues from both Cicero and Ambrose and synthesizes their traditions into a Christianized world view that still retains strong ties to the pre-Christian philosophic past.  He resolves the dilemma of just war and pacifist considerations by denying the dilemma: war is simply a part of the human experience that God Himself has ordained or permitted.  War arises from, and stands as a clear manifestation of, the nature of fallen man.  For adherents to nominal Christianity, the explanatory power of Augustine’s thoughts on just war is substantial; his approach enables Christians to understand just war as a coping mechanism for just men who are trying to get along as morally (if not as piously) as they can in an imperfect world.

However, since Augustine seeks to resolve the nature of his ethical tensions, the synthetic character of Augustine’s approach to war is important, not merely for adherents to Christianity, but also for others seeking a strictly rational account of the problem.  For example, if one were to take a de-theologized view of Augustine’s approach and focus simply upon the general theoretical problem of the morality of war, Augustine’s attempt fully deserves serious philosophical consideration. His approach explains how a morally upright citizen of a relatively just state could be justified in pursuing warfare, in prosecuting war, and ultimately, although unhappily, in taking human life.  In any case, Augustine’s just war theory arises from his most deeply rooted philosophical assumptions.  Augustine as a Christian philosopher achieves a full synthesis of the Roman and Christian values associated with war in a way that legitimizes war as an instrument of national policy which, although inferior to the perfect ideals of Christianity, is one which Christians cannot altogether avoid and with which they must in some sense make their peace.

d. Jus ad Bellum and Jus in Bello

Traditionally, the philosophical treatment of the just war is divided into two categories:  jus in bellum and jus in bello.  The former describes the necessary (and, by some accounts, sufficient) conditions for justifying engagement in war.  The latter describes the necessary conditions for conducting war in a just manner.

Augustine’s jus ad bellum prescripts enjoin that wars can be initiated justly only on the basis of:

1.  a just cause, such as to defend the state from external invasion; to defend the safety or honor of the state, with the realization that their simultaneous defense might be impossible; to avenge injuries; to punish a nation for failure to take corrective action for wrongs (legal or moral ) committed by its citizens; to come to the defense of allies; to gain the return of something that was wrongfully taken; or to obey a divine command to go to war (which, in practice, issues from the political head of state acting as God’s lieutenant on earth); and in any case, the just cause must be at least more just than the cause of one’s enemies;

2.  a rightly intended will, which has the restoration of peace as its prime objective, takes no delight in the wickedness of potential adversaries, views waging war as a stern necessity, tolerates no action calculated to provoke a war, and does not seek to conquer others merely for conquest’s sake or for territorial expansion; and

3. a declaration of war by a competent authority, and except in the most unusual of circumstances, in a public manner, and only as a last resort.

Concerning jus in bello, Augustine holds that wars, once begun, must be fought in a manner which:

1. represents a proportional response to the wrong to be avenged, with violence being constrained within the limits of military necessity;

2. discriminates between proper objects of violence (that is, combatants) and noncombatants, such as women, children, the elderly, the clergy, and so forth.; and

3. observes good faith in its interactions with the enemy, by scrupulously observing treaties and not prosecuting the war in a treacherous manner.

e. Augustine’s Conception of Peace

Both Augustine’s political world view and his approach to war incorporate his conception of peace.  According to Augustine, God designed all humans to live together in the “bond of peace.” However, fallen man lives in society  as according to the divine will or as opposing it.  Augustine distinguishes the two cities in several important ways, as well as the kind of peace they seek:

There is, in fact, one city of men who choose to live by the standard of the flesh, another of those who choose to live by the standard of the spirit.  The citizens of each of these desire their own kind of peace, and when they achieve their aim, that is the kind of peace in which they live.

Because the common choice of fallen man is a peace of his own liking—one that selfishly serves his own immediate or foreseeable ends, peace becomes, in practice, merely an interlude between ongoing states of war.  Augustine is quick to point out that this life carries with it no guarantee of peace; that blessed state is reserved for the saved in heaven.

Augustine delineates three kinds of peace:  the ultimate and perfect peace which exists exclusively in the City of God, the interior peace enjoyed by the pilgrim citizens of the City of God as they sojourn on earth, and the peace which is common to the two cities. Sadly, Augustine is abundantly clear that temporal peace is rather an anomalous condition in the totality of human history and that perfect peace is altogether unattainable on earth:

Such is the instability of human affairs that no people has ever been allowed such a degree of tranquility as to remove all dread of hostile attacks on their dwelling in this world.  That place, then, which is promised as a dwelling of such peace and security is eternal, and is reserved for eternal beings.

However, Augustine insists that, by any estimation, it is in the best interest of everyonesaint or sinner—to try to keep the peace here and now; and indeed, establishing and maintaining an earthly peace is as fundamental to the responsibilities of the state as protecting the state in times of war.

As for the church’s quest for peace, he writes, “it seems to me that no limit can be set to the number of persecutions which the Church is bound to suffer for her training;” and he opines that persecutions will continue until the final scenes of the current state of human history incidental to the second coming of Christ. Interestingly, Augustine gives no suggestion whatsoever that the rest of the earth will be at peace while this violence against the church continues.  On the contrary, the entire tenor of his argument suggests that anti-Christian violence is merely typical of the violence and disorder that will accompany the human experience until the second coming of Christ.

While men do not agree on which kind of peace to seek, all agree that peace in some form is the end they desire to achieve.  Even in war, all parties involved desire—and fight to obtain—some kind of peace.  Ironically, although peace is the end toward which wars are fought, war seems to be the more enduring, more characteristic of the two states in the human experience. War is the natural (albeit lamentable) state in which fallen man finds himself.  The flesh and the spirit of man—although both are good—are in perpetual opposition:

But what in fact, do we achieve, when we desire to be made perfect by the Highest Good?  It can, surely, only be a situation where the desires of the flesh do not oppose the spirit, and where there is in us no vice for the spirit to oppose with its desires.  Now we cannot achieve this in our present life, for all our wishing. But we can at least, with God’s help, see to it that we do not give way to the desires of the flesh which oppose the spirit to be overcome, and that we are not dragged to the perpetration of sin with our own consent.

Augustine concludes that war among men and nations cannot be avoided altogether because it is simply characteristic of the present existence.  The contention that typifies war is merely the social counterpart to the spirit-body tension that typifies every individual person.  However, man can, through the general application of divine precepts contained in scripture and through the pursuit of virtue as dictated by reason, manage that tension both on the individual and societal levels in such a way as to obtain a transitory peace.  War and peace are two sides of the same Augustinian coin.  Owing to the injustice that is inherent in the mortal state, the former is presently unavoidable, and the latter, in its perfect manifestation, is presently unattainable.

4. Conclusion

In sum, the state is an institution imposed upon fallen man for his temporal benefit, even if the majority of men will not ultimately benefit from it in light of their predestination to damnation.  However, if one can successfully set aside Augustine’s doctrine of predestination, one finds in his writings an enormously valuable descriptive account of the psychology of fallen man, which can take the reader a very great distance toward understanding social interactions among men and nations.  Although the doctrine of predestination is indispensable for understanding Augustine’s theology, its prominence does not preclude one from reaping value from his appraisal of the state of man and his political and social relationships in the fallen “earthly city,” to which all either belong or with which they have unavoidable contact.

5. References and Further Reading

All the primary sources are readily available in English.

a. Primary Sources

  • Augustine.  City of God [De civitate Dei]. Translated by Marcus Dods, in The Nicene and Post-Nicene Fathers. Edited by Philip Schaff.  First Series.  Vol. II. Grand Rapids:  Eerdmans Publishing Company, 1956.
  • Augustine.  On Christian Doctrine [De doctrina christiana]. Translated by J. F. Shaw, in The Nicene and Post-Nicene Fathers. Edited by Philip Schaff.  First Series.  Vol. II. Grand Rapids:  Eerdmans Publishing Company, 1956.
  • Augustine.  On Free Choice of the Will [De libero arbitrio libri III].  Translated by Anna S. Benjamin and L. H. Hackstaff.  New York:  Macmillan Publishing Company, 1964.
  • Augustine.  Our Lord’s Sermon on the Mount [De Sermone Domini in Monte secundum Matthaeum]. Translated by William Findlay, in The Nicene and Post-Nicene Fathers. Edited by Philip Schaff.  First Series.  Vol. VI. Grand Rapids:  Eerdmans Publishing Company, 1956.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bainton, Roland H.  Christian Attitudes Toward War and Peace:  A Historical Survey and Critical Re-evaluation. Nashville:  Abington Press, 1960.
    • On Augustine and War.
  • Battenhouse, Roy W.  A Companion to the Study of St. Augustine.  New York:  Oxford University Press, 1969.
  • Deane, Herbert A. The Political and Social Ideas of St. Augustine. New York:  Columbia University Press, 1963.
    • The indispensable and definitive work on Augustine’s political and social philosophy.
  • Gilson, Etienne.  The Christian Philosophy of Saint Augustine.  New York:  Random House, 1960.
  • Mattox, John Mark.  St. Augustine and the Theory of Just War.  London:  Thoemmes Continuum, 2006.
    • On Augustine and War.
  • Swift, Louis J.  The Early Fathers on War and Military Service. Wilmington:  Michael Glazier, Inc., 1983.
    • On Augustine and War.


Author Information

J. Mark Mattox
U. S. A.

Law and Economics

The law and economics movement applies economic theory and method to the practice of law. It asserts that the tools of economic reasoning offer the best possibility for justified and consistent legal practice. It is arguably one of the dominant theories of jurisprudence. The law and economics movement offers a general theory of law as well as conceptual tools for the clarification and improvement of its practices. The general theory is that law is best viewed as a social tool that promotes economic efficiency, that economic  analysis and efficiency as an ideal can guide legal practice.  It also considers how legislation should be used to improve market conditions  in return. Law and economics offers a framework with which to model legal outcomes, and common objectives with which to unify disparate areas of legal activity. The bringing together of legal theory and economic reasoning has also created new research agendas in the fields of behavioral economics: how rationality affects people's behavior within legal scenarios; public choice theory and how collective behavior should have an effect on legislation; and game theory: understanding strategic action in a legal context.

Table of Contents

  1. Law as an Autonomous Practice
  2. Law as a Tool to Encourage Economic Efficiency
    1. Basic Concepts in Economic Reasoning
    2. How Law Can Encourage Economic Efficiency
    3. Can All Law be Explained as Economic in Nature?
  3. Economics and Normative Jurisprudence
  4. Later Developments
    1. Behavioral Economics and Law
    2. Game Theory
    3. Public Choice Theory
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Law as an Autonomous Practice

Most traditional theories of jurisprudence look to uncover the essential or definitive aspects of the institution of law. Two of the most influential are Legal Positivism and Dworkin’s Law as Integrity. While these two differ as to their definition of law and legal reasoning, they agree upon some basic central assumptions, determining the conclusions that two philosophical investigations with largely the same aims, can reach. Because of this it is important to acknowledge some of the assumptions that are held in common by these jurisprudential stances.

First, both theories agree upon the conceptual nature of jurisprudence. Both agree that it is important for a philosophical theory of law to define the core aspects of proper legal practice in order to fulfill the function of philosophical jurisprudence. In fact, much philosophical discussion of law assumes that such a characterization is the essential aim of jurisprudence. Second in order to arrive at a properly analyzed concept of law, both legal positivism and law as integrity are best constructed from specific techniques of analytic and linguistic philosophy. These techniques include the investigation and clarification of the way people commonly speak about law and careful parsing of social practice that separate the legal from the non-legal. The third common assumption is that the best way to understand legal practice is to understand the necessary and sufficient qualities that make some rule or statement into a law. Once such a set of necessary and sufficient conditions is identified (or approximated) it is thought that the essential aspects of particularly legal practices have been understood.

Instead of following this path, theorists within the law and economics movement have attacked the study of law from another angle. Rather than trying to identify unique conceptual aspects of law, what is advocated is an investigation of legal practices through the means of economic analysis. The conclusion offered is that legal practice is best understood through its function as a social tool promoting economic efficiency, in common with other social practices.

Instead of following this path, theorists within the law and economics movement have attacked the study of law from another angle. Rather than trying to identify unique conceptual aspects of law, what is advocated is an investigation of legal practices through the means of economic analysis. The conclusion offered is that legal practice is best described by its purported function as a social tool aiming at the promotion of economic efficiency - something it has in common with other social practices.

2. Law as a Tool to Encourage Economic Efficiency

So, instead of looking for the unique and defining features of law, the practitioner of law and economics looks at law as a social tool and tries to evaluate it functionally. What is emphasized is not its uniqueness as an institution, but its place within the general and common economic structure of society. The descriptive claim most often associated with law and economics is that legal practices are best characterized as tools for encouraging economically efficient social relations. To understand this claim it is important to examine some of the basic concepts used in models of economic reasoning.

a. Basic Concepts in Economic Reasoning

Essential to an understanding of the law and economics movement is a set of fundamental concepts. The most central assumption in economics is that human beings are rational maximizers of their individual satisfactions, and, in turn, respond to incentives. A rational maximizer of personal satisfaction adjusts means to ends in the most efficient way possible. It is important to realize that economics, as understood here, is not restricted to analysis of monetary issues; there are nonmonetary as well as monetary satisfactions. Every potential satisfaction is implicated in the calculus of economic satisfactions and therefore can be investigated according to economic or means-end rationality and the trade-off of costs and benefits. Normally what is aimed at through economic reasoning is the improvement of efficiency.

A more efficient allocation is one that increases the net value of resources. Efficiency in the allocation of resources is distinguished from equity, which is concerned with justice in the distribution of wealth. Because some people value specific goods higher or lower than others, economic efficiency can often be raised through voluntary transfers of goods. The most common example of a transfer promoting efficiency is that of a freely entered into contractual relationship. Because one party to the transaction values money more than the item owned, and the other values the item owned more than the asking price, the exchange produces a net gain in economic goods. Each person ends up better off than before. Some economists have gone so far as to argue that such a contractual exchange is morally optimal because it works within both Kantian and utilitarian theories of morality. They argue that it works with Kantian theories because a contract is thought to represent a good example of interaction between free and rational agents. It works with utilitarianism because the idea of wealth maximization intuitively translates into more utility.

Economists have a variety of terms to describe possible outcomes of economic exchanges. For instance Pareto optimality is defined as a point where resources are allocated such that no one is willing to trade further. Pareto optimality is the eventual endpoint of a series of Pareto superior moves. A Pareto superior change makes at least one person better of without making anyone worse off. Because no one is worse off after the trade there are no losers in Pareto improvements, although there may be many different Pareto optimal endpoints. Furthermore, economists have developed the concept of Kaldor-Hicks efficiency to compensate for obstacles to freely contracted exchanges. Kaldor-Hicks efficiency, or potential Pareto superiority, results when the overall economic gains outweigh the losses. In other words, the gains in economic efficiency are large enough that the winners could, if they had to, compensate the losers in the new allocation of goods and still remain better off.

b. How Law Can Encourage Economic Efficiency

The law and economics movement claims that law is best understood as a tool to promote economic efficiency. But how can the institution of law help encourage efficient transactions? One way is to help avoid situations that lead to market failure. One example of market failure is the existence of monopolies: a situation where one party is able to extract more profit from a good than a healthy market would allow. Law can be used as a tool to ensure that monopoly situations are hard to bring about and maintain. Another way legal systems can be used to ensure economically efficient transactions is through the enforcement of valid contracts. By ensuring compliance with contractual terms courts can give parties to a contract confidence that the other party will fulfill the agreed-to obligations. This becomes especially important in situations where the parties must complete their obligations at different times.

But some types of market failure are less obvious, and the legal means toward remedying them subtler. One problem in market transactions is that of externalities. An externality is a cost not reflected in the market price of a good. For instance, a factory may not have to internalize the costs it imposes upon the environment into the selling price of its goods. In this case the market price of the good will not reflect its real cost – and therefore some of the costs are imposed upon parties in an involuntary manner. Pigou argues in regard to this that legal means should be used to impose a marginal tax upon the offending party, to internalize any externalities. The economist Coase argued that this conclusion, while warranted in specific cases, was too global. Coase argued that in a market where transactions are costless and people do not act strategically, rights assignments are irrelevant because from any starting point the results will be economically efficient. In other words, the Coase Theorem states that if there are no transaction costs the assignment of entitlements will be irrelevant to the goal of allocative efficiency. In such a situation there will be no need for law to internalize costs because people will bargain to the most efficient possible allocation of goods. But outside of conceptually ideal markets there are always transaction costs such as information costs, opportunity costs and administrative costs. If transaction costs are somewhat high, then it does matter how property rights are assigned. Therefore the enforcement and allocation of legal entitlements will be an important factor in ensuring economically efficient exchanges. So law can be used to encourage economic efficiency. But is all law best described in economic terms?

c. Can All Law be Explained as Economic in Nature?

It may be no real surprise that law often is used to encourage efficient exchanges. But it seems a stretch to claim that law as an institution is best completely described in economic terms. It seems counterintuitive to view all law as based upon market principles. What the economic analysis of law manages, though , is to see such disparate areas as contract, tort and criminal law as all based upon economic aims, therefore giving law a more coherent basis than other theories can offer. Richard Posner argues that tort cases - those involving private harm - can be seen as contractual by looking for the hypothetical terms that the parties to an accident would have agreed to in advance in order to bring about the accident voluntarily. Also that criminals are deterred by the threat of punishment only if the likelihood of punishment multiplied by the quantity of punishment exceeds the gain offered by the  criminal act. Scholars have been quite effective in extending the tools of economic analysis into areas that seem to be anything but economic in nature. Even rules of evidence and legal ethics have proved amenable to economic analysis. However, it may be argued that an economic explanation of law fails on two counts. Firstly as a descriptive analysis it doesn’t do justice to everyday legal conceptions. Secondly  as an analytical analysis of the necessary conditions for the practice of law  it may not be able to account for the internal point of view which Hart thought so central to a proper understanding of law. More analytical approaches to economic explanation of law have considered this a fatal flaw in the project (see Coleman 2001). This may be mistakenly importing traditional philosophical aims into a drastically different project, but the truth is that it is often hard to tell what types of theoretical claims are being made within law and economics. If the claims are of exhaustive descriptive accuracy or of the necessary and sufficient conceptual foundations of law then it is more than likely a failure. But whether or not law and economics is an accurate or even conceptually necessary description of law as a social institution, and whether or not it suffices as a complete analysis of law, it could be argued that law should in any case adopt economic efficiency as the central aim guiding judicial decision-making.

3. Economics and Normative Jurisprudence

Though analytically incomplete, economic analysis models the actual results of legal institutions better than any other theory. This does not entail, however, that law ought to be consciously used for such an aim. Might not law be better used to consider issues related to  justice, duty and the like? Advocates of law and economics have argued against such a conclusion. The arguments usually are of two types. First, it is claimed that meanings of words such as justice or duty are so vague and in dispute that the use of such concepts for a basis of judicial decisions offers no guidance whatsoever. It is argued that while such concepts are unhelpfully complex, the tools of economic analysis and the concept of economic efficiency are sufficiently clear to provide the judge a solid and predictable basis of decision. Law is better able to decide according to efficiency rather than justice or duty due to limitations of institutional competence. This might be so if issues of justice are so complex as to involve information that courts are structurally unable to process. Second, it has been argued that because the paradigm case of justice is the freely entered in to contract, law is best seen as a tool to optimize contractual arrangements. If this is so, then where law can help is in situations where transaction costs are so high as to prohibit efficient contractual relationships. Here Posner argues that law can encourage economic efficiency by assigning property rights to those parties who would have secured them through market exchange if transaction costs were lower. In other words law should bring about allocations that mimic the results of a properly functioning market. In addition, advocates of economic analysis of law make a claim that other jurisprudential traditions seem to be unable to: that the analytic tools offered by law and economics has encouraged the further creation of other productive areas for analyzing law (see Posner 1998).

4. Later Developments

Another argument for the fertility of the economic analysis of law is that it has spawned a number of further tools that seem helpful in understanding legal institutions. Three of the most important of these are the results of behavioral economics, game theory and public choice theory.

a. Behavioral Economics and Law

Practitioners of behavioral law and economics examine human limits to means-end rationality. One of the outcomes of behavioral economics is the concept of bounded rationality. Bounded rationality means that information is not processed according to a model of perfect means-end rationality but, to the contrary, is distorted due to limits of our cognitive abilities. For instance the endowment effect is thought to be a behavioral limit that distorts the proper valuation of property, an important aspect of bargaining to efficient outcomes. According to the effect, the ownership of objects creates an irrational cognitive overvaluation of them. Another claim is that our cognitive abilities are distorted by the availability heuristic. According to this the availability of strong imagery may induce us to over or underestimate the actual probability of events associated with the image. For instance, graphic representations of highly improbable harms might be more influential on behavior and demand unjustified use of resources than statistical analysis showing another equally undesirable harm to be more common and easier to avoid. Jurisprudential practices could be significantly influenced by such results. For instance, judges might be as irrationally influenced by the availability heuristic as other human beings. Therefore victim impact statements might be important correctives to proceedings if a well-presented defendant’s presence in the court skews judge or jury's decisions. An awareness of such a cognitive failure could help adjust legal reasoning and its conclusions accordingly. Finally, an awareness and exploitation of universal cognitive limits might help legislators to design more effective laws (see Sunstein 2000).

b. Game Theory

Game theory adds to economic modeling the phenomenon of strategic action. Strategic actions are those adopted because of the competitive nature of many social transactions. They are adopted due to how one individual expects another to act in response. For example, a person who wishes to buy an item cheap would act disinterested so as not to signal his or her actual desires to the seller. Addition of analytic tools dealing with strategic action greatly strengthens the economic analysis of law. For instance, the Coase theorem, to function properly, necessarily excludes strategic action; cooperation is just assumed. But it seems apparent that legal actions often are deeply implicated in and animated by strategic motives. Common sense tells us that full open cooperation is not always the best path to bringing about one’s desired results. In fact much of the bargaining invested in designing an effective contract seems to be done in the shadow of potential strategic action on the part of the contracting parties. Designing legal rules with an eye to the possibility of strategic action helps ensure that the rules will not create perverse outcomes. For instance, if a defendant’s privilege against self-incrimination could also encourage an inference of guilt from the silence the privilege would be all but useless. Therefore, courts have not only barred comment on the refusal to testify but also have required that juries, on defendant’s request, make no inference from such a choice (see Baird et al 1994). Further, the understanding that legislators might have adopted specific wording for a law based upon strategic motives may help direct the proper aims of judicial interpretation. This type of claim, though, is often better analyzed by the tools offered in public choice theory.

c. Public Choice Theory

Public choice theory is centered upon how the nature of the legislative process and collective decision making influence the nature of law. It is the application of economic models of decision-making and their results to the issues that traditionally occupy political science, for example Arrow's Theorem. One claim made within public choice theory is that a proper understanding of collective decision processes will help judges understand their position within the system. If all collective decisions are unavoidably influenced by those who get to frame the questions debated and the order of voting - the agenda-setters - public legislation will need to be interpreted differently than if it were a more neutral recording of collective wishes. Such a theoretical result makes problematic a court’s reference to the intent of the legislature.

5. References and Further Readings

  • Ackerman, Bruce, The Economic Foundations of Property Law (Boston: Little, Brown & Co., 1975)
  • Baird, Douglas, Robert Gertner and Randal Picker, Game Theory and the Law (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1994)
  • Becker, Gary S., "Nobel Lecture: The Economic Way of Looking at Behavior," 101 Journal of Political Economy 385 (1993)
  • Calabresi, Guido, The Costs of Accidents (1970)
  • Calabresi, Guido, and Douglas Melamed, "Property Rules, Liability Rules and Inalienability: One View of the Cathedral," 85 Harvard Law Review 1089 (1972)
  • Calabresi, Guido, "Some Thoughts on Risk Distribution and the Law of Torts," 70 Yale Law Journal 499 (1961)
  • Coase, Ronald, "The Problem of Social Cost," 3 Journal of Law and Economics 1 (1960)
  • Coleman, Jules, "Efficiency, Auction and Exchange: Philosophic Aspects of the Economic Approach to Law," 68 California Law Review 221 (1980)
  • Coleman, Jules, Market, Morals and the Law (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988)
  • Coleman, Jules, The Practice of Principle: In Defense of a Pragmatist Approach to Legal Theory (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2001)
  • Cotter, Thomas F., "Legal Pragmatism and the Law and Economics Movement," 84 Georgetown Law Journal 2071 (1996)
  • Farber, Daniel, and Philip Frickey, Law and Public Choice (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1991)
  • Harrison, Jeffrey L., Law and Economics (St. Paul: West Group, 1995)
  • Horwitz, Morton, "Law and Economics: Science or Politics?," 8 Hofstra Law Review 905 (1981)
  • Katz, Avery Weiner, Foundations of the Economic Approach to Law (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998)
  • Landes, William and Richard Posner, The Economic Structure of Tort Law (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1987)
  • Leff, Arthur, "Economic Analysis of Law: Some Realism About Nominalism," 60 Virginia Law Review 451 (1974)
  • Miceli, Thomas J., Economics of the Law: Torts, Contracts, Property, Litigation (1997)
  • Murphy, Jeffrie G. and Jules L. Coleman, Philosophy of Law (Boulder: Westview Press, 1990)
  • Polinsky, A. Mitchell, An Introduction to Law and Economics (Boston: Little, Brown & Company, 1989)
  • Posner, Richard A., Economic Analysis of Law (New York: Aspen, 5th ed., 1998)
  • Posner, Richard A., The Economics of Justice (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1983)
  • Posner, Richard A., Frontiers of Legal Theory (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2001)
  • Posner, Richard A., "Gary Becker's Contributions to Law and Economics," 22 Journal of Legal Studies 211 (1993)
  • "Symposium on Post-Chicago Law and Economics," 65 Chicago-Kent Law Review 1 (1989)
  • Sunstein, Cass R., Behavioral Law and Economics (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000)

Author Information

Brian Edgar Butler
University of North Carolina at Asheville
U. S. A.

The Philosophy of War


Any philosophical examination of war will  center on four general questions: What is war? What causes war? What is the relationship between human nature and war? Can war ever be morally justifiable?

Defining what war is requires determining the entities that are allowed to begin and engage in war. And a person's definition of war often expresses the person's broader political philosophy, such as limiting war to a conflict between nations or state.   Alternative definitions of war can include conflict not just between nations but between schools of thought or ideologies.

Answers to the question "What causes war?" largely depend on the philosopher's views on determinism and free will.  If a human's actions are beyond his or her control, then the cause of war is irrelevant and inescapable.  On the other hand, if war is a product of human choice, then three general groupings of causation can be identified: biological, cultural, and reason.  While exploring the root cause of conflict, this article investigates the relationship between human nature and war.

Finally, the question remains as to whether war is ever morally justified.  Just war theory is a useful structure within which the discourse of war may be ethically examined.  In the evolving context of modern warfare, a moral calculus of war will require the philosopher of war to account not only for military personnel and civilians, but also for justifiable targets, strategies, and use of weapons.

The answers to all these questions lead on to more specific and applied ethical and political questions.  Overall, the philosophy of war is complex and requires one to articulate consistent thought across the fields of metaphysics, epistemology, philosophy of mind, political philosophy, and ethics.

Table of Contents

  1. What is War?
  2. What causes war?
  3. Human Nature and War
  4. War and Political and Moral Philosophy
  5. Summary

1. What is War?

The first issue to be considered is what is war and what is its definition. The student of war needs to be careful in examining definitions of war, for like any social phenomena, definitions are varied, and often the proposed definition masks a particular political or philosophical stance paraded by the author. This is as true of dictionary definitions as well as of articles on military or political history.

Cicero defines war broadly as "a contention by force"; Hugo Grotius adds that "war is the state of contending parties, considered as such"; Thomas Hobbes notes that war is also an attitude: "By war is meant a state of affairs, which may exist even while its operations are not continued;" Denis Diderot comments that war is "a convulsive and violent disease of the body politic;" for Karl von Clausewitz, "war is the continuation of politics by other means", and so on. Each definition has its strengths and weaknesses, but often is the culmination of the writer's broader philosophical positions.

For example, the notion that wars only involve states-as Clausewitz implies-belies a strong political theory that assumes politics can only involve states and that war is in some manner or form a reflection of political activity. 'War' defined by Webster's Dictionary is a state of open and declared, hostile armed conflict between states or nations, or a period of such conflict. This captures a particularly political-rationalistic account of war and warfare, i.e., that war needs to be explicitly declared and to be between states to be a war. We find Rousseau arguing this position: "War is constituted by a relation between things, and not between persons…War then is a relation, not between man and man, but between State and State…" (The Social Contract).

The military historian, John Keegan offers a useful characterization of the political-rationalist theory of war in his A History of War. It is assumed to be an orderly affair in which states are involved, in which there are declared beginnings and expected ends, easily identifiable combatants, and high levels of obedience by subordinates. The form of rational war is narrowly defined, as distinguished by the expectation of sieges, pitched battles, skirmishes, raids, reconnaissance, patrol and outpost duties, with each possessing their own conventions. As such, Keegan notes the rationalist theory does not deal well with pre-state or non-state peoples and their warfare.

There are other schools of thought on war's nature other than the political-rationalist account, and the student of war must be careful, as noted above, not to incorporate a too narrow or normative account of war. If war is defined as something that occurs only between states, then wars between nomadic groups should not be mentioned, nor would hostilities on the part of a displaced, non-state group against a state be considered war.

An alternative definition of war is that it is an all-pervasive phenomenon of the universe. Accordingly, battles are mere symptoms of the underlying belligerent nature of the universe; such a description corresponds with a Heraclitean or Hegelian philosophy in which change (physical, social, political, economical, etc) can only arise out of war or violent conflict. Heraclitus decries that "war is the father of all things," and Hegel echoes his sentiments. Interestingly, even Voltaire, the embodiment of the Enlightenment, followed this line: "Famine, plague, and war are the three most famous ingredients of this wretched world...All animals are perpetually at war with each other...Air, earth and water are arenas of destruction." (From Pocket Philosophical Dictionary).

Alternatively, the Oxford Dictionary expands the definition to include "any active hostility or struggle between living beings; a conflict between opposing forces or principles." This avoids the narrowness of a political-rationalist conception by admitting the possibility of metaphorical, non-violent clashes between systems of thought, such as of religious doctrines or of trading companies. This perhaps indicates a too broad definition, for trade is certainly a different kind of activity than war, although trade occurs in war, and trade often motivates wars. The OED definition also seems to echo a Heraclitean metaphysics, in which opposing forces act on each other to generate change and in which war is the product of such a metaphysics. So from two popular and influential dictionaries, we have definitions that connote particular philosophical positions.

The plasticity and history of the English language also mean that commonly used definitions of war may incorporate and subsume meanings borrowed and derived from other, older languages: the relevant root systems being Germanic, Latin, Greek, and Sanskrit. Such descriptions may linger in oral and literary depictions of war, for we read of war in poems, stories, anecdotes and histories that may encompass older conceptions of war. Nonetheless, war's descriptions residing in the literature left by various writers and orators often possess similarities to modern conceptions. The differences arise from the writer's, poet's, or orator's judgement of war, which would suggest that an Ancient Greek conception of war is not so different from our own. Both could recognize the presence or absence of war. However, etymologically war's definition does refer to conceptions of war that have either been discarded or been imputed to the present definition, and a cursory review of the roots of the word war provides the philosopher with a glimpse into its conceptual status within communities and over time.

For example, the root of the English word 'war', werra, is Frankish-German, meaning confusion, discord, or strife, and the verb werran meaning to confuse or perplex. War certainly generates confusion, as Clausewitz noted calling it the "fog of war", but that does not discredit the notion that war is organized to begin with. The Latin root of bellum gives us the word belligerent, and duel, an archaic form of bellum; the Greek root of war is polemos, which gives us polemical, implying an aggressive controversy. The Frankish-Germanic definition hints at a vague enterprise, a confusion or strife, which could equally apply to many social problems besetting a group; arguably it is of a lower order sociological concept than the Greek, which draws the mind's attention to suggestions of violence and conflict, or the Latin, which captures the possibility of two sides doing the fighting.

The present employment of 'war' may imply the clash and confusion embedded in early definitions and roots, but it may also, as we have noted, unwittingly incorporate conceptions derived from particular political schools. An alternative definition that the author has worked on is that war is a state of organized, open-ended collective conflict or hostility. This is derived from contextual common denominators, that is elements that are common to all wars, and which provide a useful and robust definition of the concept. This working definition has the benefit of permitting more flexibility than the OED version, a flexibility that is crucial if we are to examine war not just as a conflict between states (that is, the rationalist position), but also a conflict between non-state peoples, non-declared actions, and highly organized, politically controlled wars as well as culturally evolved, ritualistic wars and guerrilla uprisings, that appear to have no centrally controlling body and may perhaps be described as emerging spontaneously.

The political issue of defining war poses the first philosophical problem, but once that is acknowledged, a definition that captures the clash of arms, the state of mutual tension and threat of violence between groups, the authorized declaration by a sovereign body, and so on can be drawn upon to distinguish wars from riots and rebellions, collective violence from personal violence, metaphorical clashes of values from actual or threatened clashes of arms.

2. What causes war?

Various sub-disciplines have grappled with war's etiology, but each in turn, as with definitions of war, often reflects a tacit or explicit acceptance of broader philosophical issues on the nature of determinism and freedom.

For example, if it is claimed that man is not free to choose his actions (strong determinism) then war becomes a fated fact of the universe, one that humanity has no power to challenge. Again, the range of opinions under this banner is broad, from those who claim war to be a necessary and ineluctable event, one that man can never shirk from, to those who, while accepting war's inevitability, claim that man has the power to minimize its ravages, just as prescriptive medicines may minimize the risk of disease or lightning rods the risk of storm damage. The implication is that man is not responsible for his actions and hence not responsible for war. Wherein lies its cause then becomes the intellectual quest: in the medieval understanding of the universe, the stars, planets and combinations of the four substances (earth, air, water, fire) were understood as providing the key to examining human acts and dispositions. While the modern mind has increased the complexity of the nature of the university, many still refer to the universe's material nature or its laws for examining why war arises. Some seek more complicated versions of the astrological vision of the medieval mind (e.g., Kondratieff cycle theories), whereas others delve into the newer sciences of molecular and genetic biology for explanations.

In a weaker form of determinism, theorists claim that man is a product of his environment-however that is defined-but he also possesses the power to change that environment. Arguments from this perspective become quite intricate, for they often presume that 'mankind' as a whole is subject to inexorable forces that prompt him to wage war, but that some people's acts-those of the observers, philosophers, scientists-are not as determined, for they possess the intellectual ability to perceive what changes are required to alter man's martial predispositions. Again, the paradoxes and intricacies of opinions here are curiously intriguing, for it may be asked what permits some to stand outside the laws that everybody else is subject to?

Others, who emphasize man's freedom to choose, claim that war is a product of his choice and hence is completely his responsibility. But thinkers here spread out into various schools of thought on the nature of choice and responsibility. By its very collective nature, considerations of war's causation must encroach into political philosophy and into discussions on a citizen's and a government's responsibility for a war. Such concerns obviously trip into moral issues (to what extent is the citizen morally responsible for war?), but with regards war's causation, if man is responsible for the actual initiation of war it must be asked on whose authority is war enacted? Descriptive and normative problems arise here, for one may inquire who is the legal authority to declare war, then move to issues of whether that authority has or should have legitimacy. For example, one may consider whether that authority reflects what 'the people' want (or should want), or whether the authority informs them of what they want (or should want). Are the masses easily swayed by the ideas of the élite, or do the élite ultimately pursue what the majority seeks? Here, some blame aristocracies for war (e.g., Nietzsche, who actually extols their virtues in this regard) and others blame the masses for inciting a reluctant aristocracy to fight (cf. Vico, New Science, sect. 87).

Those who thus emphasize war as a product of man's choices bring to the fore his political and ethical nature, but once the broad philosophical territory of metaphysics has been addressed other particular causes of war can be noted. These may be divided into three main groupings: those who seek war's causation in man's biology, those that seek it in his culture, and those who seek it in his faculty of reason.

Some claim war to be a product of man's inherited biology, with disagreements raging on the ensuing determinist implications. Example theories include those that claim man to be naturally aggressive or naturally territorial, more complex analyses incorporate game theory and genetic evolution to explain the occurrence of violence and war (cf. Richard Dawkins for interesting comments on this area). Within this broad school of thought, some accept that man's belligerent drives can be channeled into more peaceful pursuits (William James), some worry about man's lack of inherited inhibitions to fight with increasingly dangerous weapons (Konrad Lorenz), and others claim the natural process of evolution will sustain peaceful modes of behavior over violent (Richard Dawkins).

Rejecting biological determinism, culturalists seek to explain war's causation in terms of particular cultural institutions. Again determinism is implied when proponents claim that war is solely a product of man's culture or society, with different opinions arising as to the nature or possibility of cultural change. For example, can the 'soft morality' of trade that engages increasing numbers in peaceful intercourse counteract and even abolish bellicose cultural tendencies (as Kant believes), or are cultures subject to an inertia, in which the imposition of external penalties or a supra-national state may be the only means to peace? The problem leads to questions of an empirical and a normative nature on the manner in which some societies have foregone war and on the extent to which similar programs may be deployed in other communities. For example, what generated peace between the warring tribes of England and what denies the people of Northern Ireland or Yugoslavia that same peace?

Rationalists are those who emphasize the efficacy of man's reason in human affairs, and accordingly proclaim war to be a product of reason (or lack of). To some this is a lament-if man did not possess reason, he might not seek the advantages he does in war and he would be a more peaceful beast. To others reason is the means to transcend culturally relative differences and concomitant sources of friction, and its abandonment is the primary cause of war (cf. John Locke, Second Treatise, sect. 172). Proponents of the mutual benefits of universal reason have a long and distinguished lineage reaching back to the Stoics and echoing throughout the Natural Law philosophies of the medieval and later scholars and jurists. It finds its best advocate in Immanuel Kant and his famous pamphlet on Perpetual Peace.

Many who explain war's origins in man's abandonment of reason also derive their thoughts from Plato, who argues that "wars and revolutions and battles are due simply and solely to the body and its desires." That is, man's appetite sometimes or perpetually overwhelms his reasoning capacity, which results in moral and political degeneration. Echoes of Plato's theories abound in Western thought, resurfacing for example, in Freud's cogitation on war ("Why War") in which he sees war's origins in the death instinct, or in Dostoyevsky's comments on man's inherent barbarity: "It's just their defenselessness that tempts the tormentor, just the angelic confidence of the child who has no refuge and no appeal, that sets his vile blood on fire. In every man, of course, a beast lies hidden-the beast of rage, the beast of lustful heat at the screams of the tortured victim, the beast of lawlessness let off the chain, the beast of diseases that follow on vice, gout, kidney disease, and so on." (Brothers Karamazov, ii.V.4, "Rebellion")

The problem with focusing on one single aspect of man's nature is that while the explanation of war's causation may be simplified, the simplification ignores cogent explanations put forward by competing theories. For example, an emphasis on man's reason as the cause of war is apt to ignore deep cultural structures that may perpetuate war in the face of the universal appeal to peace, and similarly may ignore inherited pugnacity in some individuals or even in some groups. Similarly, an emphasis on the biological etiology of war can ignore man's intellectual capacity to control, or his will to go against, his predispositions. In other words, human biology can affect thinking (what is thought, how, for what duration and intensity), and can accordingly affect cultural developments, and in turn cultural institutions can affect biological and rational developments (e.g., how strangers are welcomed affects a group's isolation or integration and hence its reproductive gene pool).

The examination of war's causation triggers the need for elaboration on many sub-topics, regardless of the internal logical validity of a proposed explanation. Students of war thus need to explore beyond proffered definitions and explanations to consider the broader philosophical problems that they often conceal.

3. Human Nature and War

A setting to explore the relationship between human nature and war is provided by Thomas Hobbes, who presents a state of nature in which the 'true' or 'underlying' nature of man is likely to come to the fore of our attention. Hobbes is adamant that without an external power to impose laws, the state of nature would be one of immanent warfare. That is, "during the time men live without a common Power to keep them all in awe, they are in that condition which is called Warre; and such a warre, as is of every man, against every man." (Leviathan, 1.13) Hobbes's construction is a useful starting point for discussions on man's natural inclinations and many of the great philosophers who followed him, including Locke, Rousseau, and Kant, agree to some extent or other with his description. Locke rejects Hobbes's complete anarchic and total warlike state but accepts that there will always be people who will take advantage of the lack of legislation and enforcement. Rousseau inverts Hobbes's image to argue that in the state of nature man is naturally peaceful and not belligerent, however when Rousseau elaborates on international politics he is of a similar mind, arguing that states must be active (aggressive) otherwise they decline and founder; war is inevitable and any attempts at peaceful federations are futile. (From Rousseau's notes on L'état de guerre criticizing the earlier pamphlet of the Abbé Saint-Pierre entitled Perpetual Peace, a title Kant later usurps).

Kant's position is that the innate conflict between men and later between states prompts humanity to seek peace and federation. It is not that man's reason alone teaches him the benefits of a pacifistic concord, but that war, which is inevitable when overarching structures are absent, induces men to consider and realize more peaceful arrangements of their affairs, yet even Kant retained a pessimistic conception of mankind: "War...seems to be ingrained in human nature, and even to be regarded as something noble to which man is inspired by his love of honor, without selfish motives." (Perpetual Peace)

Hobbes presents an atomistic conception of humanity, which many disagree with. Communitarians of various hues reject the notion of an isolated individual pitted against others and prompted to seek a contract between themselves for peace. Some critics prefer an organic conception of the community in which the individual's ability to negotiate for peace (through a social contract) or to wage war is embedded in the social structures that form him. Reverting to John Donne's "no man is an island" and to Aristotle's "man is a political animal", proponents seek to emphasize the social connections that are endemic to human affairs, and hence any theoretical construction of human nature, and thus of war, requires an examination of the relevant society man lives in. Since the governing elements of man's nature are thereby relative to time and place, so too is war's nature and ethic, although proponents of this viewpoint can accept the persistence of cultural forms over time. For instance, the communitarian view of war implies that Homeric war is different from war in the Sixteenth Century, but historians might draw upon evidence that the study of Greek warfare in the Iliad may influence later generations in how they conceive themselves and warfare.

Others reject any theorizing on human nature. Kenneth Waltz, for example argues: "While human nature no doubt plays a role in bringing about war, it cannot by itself explain both war and peace, except by the simple statement that sometimes he fights and sometimes he does not." (Man, War, and State), and existentialists deny such an entity is compatible with complete freedom of will (cf. Sartre). This danger here is that this absolves any need to search for commonalties in warriors of different periods and areas, which could be of great benefit both to military historians and peace activists.

4. War and Political and Moral Philosophy

The first port of call for investigating war's morality is the just war theory, which is well discussed and explained in many text books and dictionaries and can also be viewed on the IEP.

However, once the student has considered, or is at least aware of the broader philosophical theories that may relate to war, an analysis of its ethics begins with the question: is war morally justifiable? Again, due notice must be given to conceptions of justice and morality that involve both individuals and groups. War as a collective endeavor engages a co-ordinated activity in which not only the ethical questions of agent responsibility, obedience and delegation are ever present but so too are questions concerning the nature of agency. Can nations be morally responsible for the war's they are involved in, or should only those with the power to declare war be held responsible? Similarly, should individual Field Marshalls be considered the appropriate moral agent or the army as a corporate body? What guilt, if any, should the Private bear for his army's aggression, and likewise what guilt, if any, should a citizen, or even a descendant, bear for his country's war crimes? (And is there such a thing as a 'war crime'?)

Just war theory begins with an assessment of the moral and political criteria for justifying the initiation of war (defensive or aggressive), but critics note that the justice of warfare is already presumed in just war theory: all that is being outlined are the legal, political, and moral criteria for its justice. Thus the initial justice of war requires reflection. Pacifists deny that war, or even any kind of violence, can be morally permissible, but, as with the other positions noted above, a variety of opinions exists here, some admitting the use of war only in defense and as a last resort (defencists) whereas others absolutely do not admit violence or war of any sort (absolutist pacifists). Moving from the pacifist position, other moralists admit the use of war as a means to support, defend, or secure peace, but such positions may permit wars of defense, deterrence, aggression, and intervention for that goal.

Beyond what has been called the pacificistic morality (in which peace is the end goal as distinct from pacifism and its rejection of war as a means), are those theories that establish an ethical value in war. Few consider war should be fought for war's sake, but many writers have supported war as a means to various ends other than peace. For example, as a vehicle to forge national identity, to pursue territorial aggrandizement, or to uphold and strive for a variety of virtues such as glory and honor. In this vein of thought, those who are now characterized as social darwinists and their intellectual kin may be heard extolling the evolutionary benefits of warfare, either for invigorating individuals or groups to pursue the best of their abilities, or to remove weaker members or groups from political ascendancy.

The morality of war traipses into the related area of political philosophy in which conceptions of political responsibility and sovereignty, as well as notions of collective identity and individuality, should be acknowledged and investigated. Connections back to war's causation can also be noted. For example, if the moral code of war concerns the corporate entity of the state, then it is to the existence or behavior of the state that we turn to explain how war's originate. This raises problems concerning the examination of the moral and political responsibility for war's initiation and procedure: if states are war's harbingers, then does it follow that only the state's leaders are morally and politically responsible, or if we accept some element of Humean democracy (namely that governments are always subject to the sanction of the people they rule or represent) then moral and political responsibility extends to the citizenry.

Once war commences, whatever its merits, philosophers disagree on the role, if any, of morality within war. Many have claimed morality is necessarily discarded by the very nature of war including Christian thinkers such as Augustine, whereas others have sought to remind warriors both of the existence of moral relations in war and of various strictures to remain sensitive to moral ends. Sociologically, those going to and coming back from war often go through rites and rituals that symbolize their stepping out of, or back into, civil society, as if their transition is to a different level of morality and agency. War typically involves killing and the threat of being killed, which existentialist writers have drawn on in their examination of war's phenomenology.

For the ethicist, questions begin with identifying morally permissible or justifiable targets, strategies, and weapons-that is, of the principles of discrimination and proportionality. Writers disagree on whether all is fair in war, or whether certain modes of conflict ought to be avoided. The reasons for maintaining some moral dimensions include: the preponderance or expectation of peaceful intercourse on other levels; the mutual benefits of refraining from certain acts and the fear of retaliation in kind; and the existence of treatises and covenants that nations may seek to abide by to maintain international status.

A useful distinction here is between absolute war and total war. Absolute war describes the deployment of all of a society's resources and citizens into working for the war machine. Total war, on the other hand, describes the absence of any restraint in warfare. Moral and political responsibility becomes problematic for proponents of both absolute and total war, for they have to justify the incorporation of civilians who do not work for the war effort as well as the infirm, children, and the handicapped and wounded who cannot fight. Supporters of absolute warfare may argue that membership of a society involves responsibilities for its protection, and if some members are literally unable to assist then all other able-bodied civilians have an absolute duty to do their part. The literature of war propaganda relates well here, as does the penal morality for those who refuse and the definitional politics of the wide range of people who may not wish to fight from conscientious objectors to traitors.

Similar issues dog those who support total warfare in which the military target traditionally sacrosanct people and entities: from non-combatants, women and children, to works of art and heritage buildings. Supporters may evoke the sliding scale that Michael Walzer describes in Just and Unjust Wars, in which graver threats to the body politic may permit the gradual weakening of moral constraints. Curiously, considering his strong emphasis on social virtues, David Hume accepts the abandonment of all notions of justice in war or when the agent's plight is so dire that recourse to any action becomes permissible (cf. Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, sect.3). Others merely state that war and morality do not mix.

5. Summary

The nature of the philosophy of war is complex and this article has sought to establish a broad vision of its landscape and the connections that are endemic to any philosophical analysis of the topic. The subject matter lends itself to metaphysical and epistemological considerations, to the philosophy of mind and of human nature, as well as to the more traditional areas of moral and political philosophy. In many respects the philosophy of war demands a thorough investigation of all aspects of a thinker's beliefs, as well as presenting an indication of a philosopher's position on connected topics. To begin a philosophical discussion of war draws one onto a long and complex intellectual path of study and continual analysis; whereas a cursory announcement of what one thinks on war can be, or points to, the culmination of thoughts on related topics and a deduction from one to the other can and should always be made.

Author Information

Alexander Moseley
United Kingdom

Religion and Politics

The relation between religion and politics continues to be an important theme in political philosophy, despite the emergent consensus (both among political theorists and in practical political contexts, such as the United Nations) on the right to freedom of conscience and on the need for some sort of separation between church and state. One reason for the importance of this topic is that religions often make strong claims on people’s allegiance, and universal religions make these claims on all people, rather than just a particular community. For example, Islam has traditionally held that all people owe obedience to Allah’s will. Thus, it is probably inevitable that religious commitments will sometimes come into conflict with the demands of politics. But religious beliefs and practices also potentially support politics in many ways. The extent and form of this support is as important to political philosophers as is the possibility for conflict. Moreover, there has been a growing interest in minority groups and the political rights and entitlements they are due. One result of this interest is substantial attention given to the particular concerns and needs of minority groups who are distinguished by their religion, as opposed to ethnicity, gender, or wealth.

This article surveys some of the philosophical problems raised by the various ways in which religion and politics may intersect. The first two main sections are devoted to topics that have been important in previous eras, especially the early modern era, although in both sections there is discussion of analogs to these topics that are more pressing for contemporary political thought: (1) establishment of a church or faith versus complete separation of church and state; and (2) toleration versus coercion of religious belief, and current conflicts between religious practice and political authority. The second pair of sections is devoted to problems that, for the most part, have come to the fore of discussion only in recent times: (3) liberal citizenship and its demands on private self-understanding; and (4) the role of religion in public deliberation.

Table of Contents

  1. Establishment and Separation of Church and State
  2. Toleration and Accommodation of Religious Belief and Practice
  3. Liberalism and Its Demands on Private Self-Understanding
  4. Religious Reasons in Public Deliberation
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Establishment and Separation of Church and State

While the topic of establishment has receded in importance at present, it has been central to political thought in the West since at least the days of Constantine. In the wake of the Protestant Reformation, European societies wrestled with determining exactly what roles church and state should play in each other’s sphere, and so the topic of establishment became especially pressing in the early modern era, although there was also substantial discussion in the Middle Ages (Dante, 1995). The term “establishment” can refer to any of several possible arrangements for a religion in a society’s political life. These arrangements include the following:

  1. A religious body may be a “state” church in the sense that it has an exclusive right to practice its faith.
  2. A church may be supported through taxes and subject to the direction of the government (for example, the monarch is still officially the head of the Church of England, and the Prime Minister is responsible for selecting the Archbishop of Canterbury).
  3. Particular ecclesiastical officials may have, in virtue of their office, an established role in political institutions.
  4. A church may simply have a privileged role in certain public, political ceremonies (for example, inaugurations, opening of parliament, etc.).
  5. Instead of privileging a particular religious group, a state could simply enshrine a particular creed or belief system as its official religion, much like the “official bird” or “official flower.”

Note that these options are not mutually exclusive—a state could adopt some or all of these measures. What is central to them is they each involve the conferral of some sort of official status. A weaker form of an established church is what Robert Bellah (1967: 3-4) calls “civil religion,” in which a particular church or religion does not exactly have official status, and yet the state uses religious concepts in an explicitly public way. For an example of civil religion, he points to Abraham Lincoln’s use of Christian imagery of slavery and freedom in justifying the American Civil War.

Contemporary philosophical defenses of outright establishment of a church or faith are few, but a famous defense of establishment was given by T. S. Eliot in the last century (1936, 1967). Trained as a philosopher (he completed, but did not defend, a dissertation at Harvard on the philosophy of F. H. Bradley) and deeply influenced by Aristotle, Eliot believed that democratic societies rejected the influence of an established church at their peril, for in doing so they cut themselves off from the kind of ethical wisdom that can come only from participation in a tradition. As a result, he argued, such a society would degenerate into tyranny and/or social and cultural fragmentation.

Even today, there are strains of conservatism that argue for establishment by emphasizing the benefits that will accrue to the political system or society at large (Scruton, 1980). According to this line of thought, the healthy polis requires a substantial amount of pre- or extra-political social cohesion. More specifically, a certain amount of social cohesion is necessary both to ensure that citizens see themselves as sufficiently connected to each other (so that they will want to cooperate politically), and to ensure that they have a common framework within which they can make coherent collective political decisions. This cohesion in turn is dependent on a substantial amount of cultural homogeneity, especially with respect to adherence to certain values. One way of ensuring this kind of homogeneity is to enact one of the forms of establishment mentioned above, such as displaying religious symbols in political buildings and monuments, or by including references to a particular religion in political ceremonies.

Rather than emphasizing the distinctively political benefits of establishment, a different version of this argument could appeal to the ethical benefits that would accrue to citizens themselves as private individuals. For example, on many understandings of politics, one of the purposes of the polis is to ensure that citizens have the resources necessary for living a choiceworthy, flourishing life. One such resource is a sense of belonging to a common culture that is rooted in a tradition, as opposed to a sense of rootlessness and social fragmentation (Sandel, 1998; MacIntyre, 1984). Thus, in order to ensure that citizens have this sense of cultural cohesion, the state must (or at least may) in some way privilege a religious institution or creed. Of course, a different version of this argument could simply appeal to the truth of a particular religion and to the good of obtaining salvation, but given the persistent intractability of settling such questions, this would be a much more difficult argument to make.

Against these positions, the liberal tradition has generally opposed establishment in all of the aforementioned forms. Contemporary liberals typically appeal to the value of fairness. It is claimed, for example, that the state should remain neutral among religions because it is unfair—especially for a democratic government that is supposed to represent all of the people composing its demos—to intentionally disadvantage (or unequally favor) any group of citizens in their pursuit of the good as they understand it, religious or otherwise (Rawls, 1971). Similarly, liberals often argue that fairness precludes devoting tax revenues to religious groups because doing so amounts to forcing non-believers to subsidize religions that they reject. A different approach for liberals is to appeal directly to the right to practice one’s religion, which is derivable from a more general right to freedom of conscience. If all people have such a right, then it is morally wrong for the state to force them to participate in religious practices and institutions that they would otherwise oppose, such as forcing them to take part in public prayer. It is also wrong, for the same reason, to force people to support financially (via taxation) religious institutions and communities that they would not otherwise wish to support.

In addition, there are liberal consequentialist concerns about establishment, such as the possibility that it will result in or increase the likelihood of religious repression and curtailment of liberty (Audi, 2000: 37-41). While protections and advantages given to one faith may be accompanied by promises to refrain from persecuting adherents of rival faiths, the introduction of political power into religion moves the state closer to interferences which are clearly unjust, and it creates perverse incentives for religious groups to seek more political power in order to get the upper hand over their rivals. From the perspective of many religious people themselves, moreover, there are worries that a political role for their religion may well corrupt their faith community and its mission.

2. Toleration and Accommodation of Religious Belief and Practice

As European and American societies faced the growing plurality of religious beliefs, communities, and institutions in the early modern era, one of the paramount social problems was determining whether and to what extent they should be tolerated. One of the hallmark treatises on this topic remains John Locke’s A Letter Concerning Toleration. A political exile himself at the time of its composition, Locke argues (a) that it is futile to attempt to coerce belief because it does not fall to the will to accept or reject propositions, (b) that it is wrong to restrict religious practice so long as it does not interfere with the rights of others, and (c) that allowing a wide range of religious groups will likely prevent any one of them from becoming so powerful as to threaten the peace. Central to his arguments is a Protestant view of a religious body as a voluntary society composed only of those people who choose to join it, a view that is in sharp contrast to the earlier medieval view of the church as having authority over all people within a particular geographic domain. It is perhaps unsurprising, then, that the limits of Locke’s toleration are coextensive with Protestantism; atheists and Catholics cannot be trusted to take part in society peacefully because the former do not see themselves as bound by divine law and the latter are beholden to a foreign sovereign (the Pope). Still, Locke’s Letter makes an important step forward toward a more tolerant and pluralistic world. In contrast to Locke, Thomas Hobbes sees religion and its divisiveness as a source of political instability, and so he argues that the sovereign has the right to determine which opinions may be publicly espoused and disseminated, a power necessary for maintaining civil peace (see Leviathan xviii, 9).

Like the issue of establishment, the general issue of whether people should be allowed to decide for themselves which religion to believe in has not received much attention in recent times, again because of the wide consensus on the right of all people to liberty of conscience. However, despite this agreement on liberty of belief, modern states nevertheless face challenging questions of toleration and accommodation pertaining to religious practice, and these questions are made more difficult by the fact that they often involve multiple ideals which pull in different directions. Some of these questions concern actions which are inspired by religion and are either obviously or typically unjust. For example, violent fundamentalists feel justified in killing and persecuting infidels—how should society respond to them? While no one seriously defends the right to repress other people, it is less clear to what extent, say, religious speech that calls for such actions should be tolerated in the name of a right to free speech. A similar challenge concerns religious objections to certain medical procedures that are necessary to save a life. For example, Jehovah’s Witnesses believe that their religion precludes their accepting blood transfusions, even to save their lives. While it seems clearly wrong to force someone to undergo even lifesaving treatment if she objects to it (at least with sufficient rationality, which of course is a difficult topic in itself), and it seems equally wrong to deny lifesaving treatment to someone who needs it and is not refusing it, the issue becomes less clear when parents have religious objections to lifesaving treatment for their children. In such a case, there are at least three values that ordinarily demand great respect and latitude: (a) the right to follow one’s own religion, not simply in affirming its tenets but in living the lifestyle it prescribes; (b) the state’s legitimate interest in protecting its citizens (especially vulnerable ones like children) from being harmed; and (c) the right of parents to raise their children as they see fit and in a way that expresses their values.

A second kind of challenge for a society that generally values toleration and accommodation of difference pertains to a religious minority’s actions and commitments which are not themselves unjust, and yet are threatened by the pursuit of other goals on the part of the larger society, or are directly forbidden by law. For example, Quakers and other religious groups are committed to pacifism, and yet many of them live in societies that expect all male citizens to serve in the military or register for the draft. Other groups perform religious rituals that involve the use of illegal substances, such as peyote. Does the right to practice one’s faith exempt one from the requirement to serve in the military or obey one’s country’s drug policies? Is it fair to exempt such people from the burdens other citizens must bear?

Many examples of this second kind of challenge are addressed in the literature on education and schooling. In developed societies (and developing ones, for that matter), a substantial education is necessary for citizens to be able to achieve a decent life for themselves. In addition, many states see education as a process by which children can learn values that the state deems important for active citizenship and/or for social life. However, the pursuit of this latter goal raises certain issues for religious parents. In the famous case of Mozert v. Hawkins, some parents objected for religious reasons to their children being taught from a reading curriculum that presented alternative beliefs and ways of life in a favorable way, and consequently the parents asked that their children be excused from class when that curriculum was being taught. Against the wishes of these parents, some liberals believe that the importance of teaching children to respect the value of gender equality overrides the merit of such objections, even if they appeal directly to the parents’ religious rights (Macedo, 2000).

Similarly, many proposals for educational curricula are aimed at developing a measure of autonomy in children, which often involves having them achieve a certain critical distance from their family background, with its traditions, beliefs, and ways of life (Callan, 1997; Brighouse, 2000). The idea is that only then can children autonomously choose a way of life for themselves, free of undue influence of upbringing and custom. A related argument holds that this critical distance will allow children to develop a sufficient sense of respect for different social groups, a respect that is necessary for the practice of democratic citizenship. However, this critical distance is antithetical to authentic religious commitment, at least on some accounts (see the following section). Also, religious parents typically wish to pass on their faith to their children, and doing so involves cultivating religious devotion through practices and rituals, rather than presenting their faith as just one among many equally good (or true) ones. For such parents, passing on their religious faith is central to good parenting, and in this respect it does not differ from passing on good moral values, for instance. Thus, politically mandated education that is aimed at developing autonomy runs up against the right of some parents to practice their religion and the right to raise their children as they choose. Many, though not all, liberals argue that autonomy is such an important good that its promotion justifies using techniques that make it harder for such parents to pass on their faith—such a result is an unfortunate side-effect of a desirable or necessary policy.

Yet a different source of political conflict for religious students in recent years concerns the teaching of evolution in science classes. Some religious parents of children in public schools see the teaching of evolution as a direct threat to their faith, insofar as it implies the falsity of their biblical-literalist understanding of the origins of life. They argue that it is unfair to expect them to expose their children to teaching that directly challenges their religion (and to fund it with their taxes). Among these parents, some want schools to include discussions of intelligent design and creationism (some who write on this issue see intelligent design and creationism as conceptually distinct positions; others see no significant difference between them), while others would be content if schools skirted the issue altogether, refusing to teach anything at all about the origin of life or the evolution of species. Their opponents see the former proposal as an attempt to introduce an explicitly religious worldview into the classroom, hence one that runs afoul of the separation of church and state. Nor would they be satisfied with ignoring the issue altogether, for evolution is an integral part of the framework of modern biology and a well-established scientific theory.

Conflicts concerning religion and politics arise outside of curricular contexts, as well. For example, in France, a law was recently passed that made it illegal for students to wear clothing and adornments that are explicitly associated with a religion. This law was especially opposed by students whose religion explicitly requires them to wear particular clothing, such as a hijab or a turban. The justification given by the French government was that such a measure was necessary to honor the separation of church and state, and useful for ensuring that the French citizenry is united into a whole, rather than divided by religion. However, it is also possible to see this law as an unwarranted interference of the state in religious practice. If liberty of conscience includes not simply a right to believe what one chooses, but also to give public expression to that belief, then it seems that people should be free to wear clothing consistent with their religious beliefs.

Crucial to this discussion of the effect of public policy on religious groups is an important distinction regarding neutrality. The liberal state is supposed to remain neutral with regard to religion (as well as race, sexual orientation, physical status, age, etc.). However, as Charles Larmore points out in Patterns of Moral Complexity (1987: 42ff), there are different senses of neutrality, and some policies may fare well with respect to one sense and poorly with respect to another. In one sense, neutrality can be understood in terms of a procedure that is justified without appeal to any conception of the human good. In this sense, it is wrong for the state to intend to disadvantage one group of citizens, at least for its own sake and with respect to practices that are not otherwise unjust or politically undesirable. Thus it would be a violation of neutrality in this sense (and therefore wrong) for the state simply to outlaw the worship of Allah. Alternatively, neutrality can be understood in terms of effect. The state abides by this sense of neutrality by not taking actions whose consequences are such that some individuals or groups in society are disadvantaged in their pursuit of the good. For a state committed to neutrality thus understood, even if it were not explicitly intending to disadvantage a particular group, any such disadvantage that may result is a prima facie reason to revoke the policy that causes it. Thus, if the government requires school attendance on a religious group’s holy days, for example, and doing so makes it harder for them to practice their faith, such a requirement counts as a failure of neutrality. The attendance requirement may nevertheless be unavoidable, but as it stands, it is less than optimal. Obviously, this is a more demanding standard, for it requires the state to consider possible consequences—both short term and long term—on a wide range of social groups and then choose from those policies that do not have bad consequences (or the one that has the fewest and least bad). For most, and arguably all, societies, it is a standard that cannot feasibly be met. Consequently, most liberals argue that the state should be neutral in the first sense, but it need not be neutral in the second sense. Thus, if the institutions and practices of a basically just society make it more challenging for some religious people to preserve their ways of life, it is perhaps regrettable, but not unjust, so long as these institutions and practices are justified impartially.

3. Liberalism and Its Demands on Private Self-Understanding

In addition to examining issues of toleration and accommodation on the level of praxis, there has also been much recent work about the extent to which particular political theories themselves are acceptable or unacceptable from religious perspectives. One reason for this emphasis comes from the emergence of the school of thought known as “political liberalism.” In his book of that name, John Rawls (1996) signaled a new way of thinking about liberalism that is captured by the idea of an “overlapping consensus.” An overlapping consensus refers to reasoned agreement on principles of justice by citizens who hold a plurality of mutually exclusive comprehensive doctrines (a term that includes religious beliefs, metaphysical positions, theories of morality and of the good life, etc., and may also include beliefs such as theories of epistemic justification). Rather than requiring citizens to accept any particular comprehensive doctrine of liberalism, a theory of justice should aim at deriving principles that each citizen may reasonably accept from his or her own comprehensive doctrine. Thus, the consensus is on the principles themselves, rather than the justification for those principles, and as such the conception of justice offered is “political” rather than “metaphysical.” This view of liberal justice marked a break with Rawls’s earlier “metaphysical” liberalism as expressed in A Theory of Justice, although debate continues among commentators about just how sharp a break political liberalism is and whether or not it is an improvement over the earlier view. The aim, then, for a political conception of justice is for all reasonable citizens to be able to affirm principles of justice without having to weaken their hold on their own private comprehensive views. However, some writers have argued that this is impossible—even a “thin” political conception of justice places strains on some comprehensive doctrines, and these strains might be acute for religious citizens. One such argument comes from Eomann Callan, in his book Creating Citizens. Callan points to the role played in Rawls’ theory of “the burdens of judgment” (see Rawls, 1996: § 2): fundamentalists will not be able to accept the burdens of judgment in their private lives, because doing so requires them to view rival faiths and other beliefs as having roughly equal epistemic worth. If Rawlsian liberalism requires acceptance of the burdens of judgment, then the overlapping consensus will not include some kinds of religious citizens.

A different way that liberal citizenship might conflict with a religious person’s self-understanding is if the former requires a commitment to a kind of fallibilism while the latter requires (or at least encourages) certitude in one’s religious belief. Richard Rorty has been read as arguing for the need for liberal democratic citizens to privatize their faith (1999) and to hold their beliefs at an “ironic” distance—that is, provisionally, and with a healthy skepticism about the extent to which they decisively capture reality (1989). But this kind of irony is not possible to maintain along with authentic faith, at least as the latter is understood in many religious traditions that emphasize the importance of certitude in one’s belief and totality of one’s commitment to God.

Thus, a religious citizen could feel an acute conflict between her identity qua citizen and qua religious adherent. One way of resolving the conflict is to argue that one aspect of her identity should take priority over the other. Witness the conflict experienced by the protagonist in Sophocles’ Antigone, as she buries her brother in defiance of Creon’s decree; in doing so, she acknowledges that her religious duties supersede her civic duties, at least in that context. For many religious citizens, political authority is subservient to—and perhaps even derived from—divine authority, and therefore they see their religious commitments as taking precedence over their civic ones. On the other hand, civic republicanism has tended to view a person’s civic role as paramount because it has seen participation in politics as partly constitutive of the human good (Dagger, 1997).

In contrast to these approaches, the liberal tradition has tended to refuse to prioritize one aspect of an individual’s identity over any other, holding that it is the individual’s task to determine which is most important or significant to her; this task is often seen as the reason for the importance of personal autonomy (Kymlicka, 2002). But this tendency makes it more challenging for liberals to adjudicate conflicts between religion and politics. One possibility is for the liberal to argue that the demands of justice are prior to the pursuit of the good (which would include religious practice). If so, and if the demands of justice require one to honor duties of citizenship, then one might argue that people should not allow their religious beliefs and practices to restrict or interfere with their roles as citizens. However, not even all liberals accept the claim that justice is prior to the good, nor is it a settled issue in the literature on political obligation that norms of justice can successfully ground universal duties of citizenship (see “The Obligation to Obey Law” and “Political Obligation”).

4. Religious Reasons in Public Deliberation

One recent trend in democratic theory is an emphasis on the need for democratic decisions to emerge from processes that are informed by deliberation on the part of the citizenry, rather than from a mere aggregation of preferences. As a result, there has been much attention devoted to the kinds of reasons that may or may not be appropriate for public deliberation in a pluralistic society. While responses to this issue have made reference to all kinds of beliefs, much of the discussion has centered on religious beliefs. One reason for this emphasis is that, both historically and in contemporary societies, religion has played a central role in political life, and often it has done so for the worse (witness the wars of religion in Europe that came in the wake of the Protestant Reformation, for example). As such, it is a powerful political force, and it strikes many who write about this issue as a source of social instability and repression. Another reason is that, due to the nature of religious belief itself, if any kind of belief is inappropriate for public deliberation, then religious beliefs will be the prime candidate, either because they are irrational, or immune to critique, or unverifiable, etc. In other words, religion provides a useful test case in evaluating theories of public deliberation.

Much of the literature in this area has been prompted by Rawls’ development of his notion of public reason, which he introduced in Political Liberalism and offered (in somewhat revised form) in his essay “The Idea of Public Reason Revisited.” His view is not as clearly expressed as one would wish, and it evolved after the publication of Political Liberalism, but the idea is something like this: when reasonable citizens engage in public deliberation on constitutional essentials, they must do so by offering reasons that do not appeal to any comprehensive doctrine. Since citizens have sharp disagreements on comprehensive doctrines, any law or policy that necessarily depends on such a doctrine could not be reasonably accepted by those who reject the doctrine. A prime example of a justification for a law that is publicly inaccessible in this way is one that is explicitly religious. For example, if the rationale for a law that outlawed working on Sunday was simply that it displeases the Christian God, non-Christians could not reasonably accept it.

Rawls makes important exceptions to this norm of public discourse, and he seems to have gradually softened its requirements somewhat as he developed his views on public reason, but his intention was to ensure that democratic outcomes could be reasonably accepted by all citizens, and even in his theory’s latest manifestations he seemed to view “public” reasons as those which could reasonably be accepted by everyone rather than explicitly drawing on comprehensive views.

A different explanation of “reasons which could be reasonably accepted by everyone” comes from Robert Audi, who argues that the set of such reasons is restricted to secular reasons. Since only secular reasons are publicly accessible in this way, civic virtue requires offering secular reasons and being sufficiently motivated by them to support or oppose the law or policy under debate. Religious reasons are not suitable for public deliberation since they are not shared by the non-religious (or people of differing religions) and people who reject these reasons would justifiably resent being coerced on the basis of them. However, secular reasons can include non-religious comprehensive doctrines, such as particular moral theories or conceptions of the human good, and so Audi’s conception of public deliberation allows some views to play a role that would be excluded by conceptions that restrict all comprehensive doctrines.

Proponents of the idea that the set of suitable reasons for public deliberation does not include certain or all comprehensive doctrines have come to be known as “exclusivists,” and their opponents as “inclusivists.” The latter group sometimes focuses on weaknesses of exclusivism—if exclusivism is false, then inclusivism is true by default. Others try to show that religious justifications can contribute positively to democratic polities; the two most common examples in support of this position are the nineteenth-century abolitionist movement and the twentieth-century civil rights movement, both of which achieved desirable political change in large part by appealing directly to the Christian beliefs prevalent in Great Britain and the United States.

A third inclusivist argument is that it is unfair to hamstring certain groups in their attempts to effect change that they believe is required by justice. Consider the case of abortion, an example Rawls discusses in a famous footnote in Political Liberalism (243-244) and again in “The Idea of Public Reason Revisited” (169). Many—though not all—who defend the pro-life position do so by appealing to the actual or potential personhood of fetuses. But “person” is a conceptually “thick” metaphysical concept, and as such it is one that is subject to reasonable disagreement. Consequently, on some versions of exclusivism, citizens who wish to argue against abortion should do so without claiming that fetuses are persons. But for these citizens, personhood is the most important part of the abortion issue, for the ascription of “person” is not simply a metaphysical issue—it is a moral issue, as well, insofar as it is an attempt to discern the bounds of the moral community. To ask them to refrain from focusing on this aspect of the issue looks like an attempt to settle the issue by default, then. Instead, inclusivists argue that citizens should feel free to introduce any considerations whatsoever that they think are relevant to the topic under public discussion.

5. Conclusion

Although secularism is proceeding rapidly in many of the world’s societies, and although this trend seems connected in some way to the process of economic development, nevertheless religion continues to be an important political phenomenon throughout the world, for multiple reasons. Even the most secularized countries (Sweden is typically cited as a prime example) include substantial numbers of people who still identify themselves as religious. Moreover, many of these societies are currently experiencing immigration from groups who are more religious than native-born populations and who follow religions that are alien to the host countries’ cultural heritage. These people are often given substantial democratic rights, sometimes including formal citizenship. And the confrontation between radical Islam and the West shows few signs of abating anytime soon. Consequently, the problems discussed above will likely continue to be important ones for political philosophers in the foreseeable future.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Audi, Robert. Religious Commitment and Secular Reason. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
    • Much of this book is an expression of Audi’s position on public deliberation, but there is also discussion of the separation of church and state.
  • Audi, Robert, and Nicholas Wolterstorff. Religion in the Public Square: The Place of Religious Reasons in Political Debate. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 1997.
    • An accessible, well-reasoned exchange between an inclusivist (Wolterstorff) and an exclusivist (Audi), with rebuttals.
  • Bellah, Robert N. “American Civil Religion.” Daedalus: Journal of the American Academy of Arts and Sciences 96.1 (1967): 1-21.
  • Brighouse, Harry. School Choice and Social Justice. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003.
    • Portions of this book deal with education for autonomy and religious opposition to such proposals.
  • Burtt, Shelley, “Religious Parents, Secular Schools: A Liberal Defense of Illiberal Education” The Review of Politics 56.1 (1994): 51-70.
  • Callan, Eomann, Creating Citizens: Political Education and Liberal Democracy. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1997.
    • An exploration of civic education in light of Rawlsian political liberalism.
  • Carter, Stephen L. The Culture of Disbelief: How American Law and Politics Trivialize Religious Devotion. New York: Basic Books, 1993.
  • Clanton, J. Caleb. Religion and Democratic Citizenship: Inquiry and Conviction in the American Public Square. Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2007.
  • Coleman, John A., ed. Christian Political Ethics. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 2007.
    • A collection of essays on political topics from a wide array of Christian traditions.
  • Cuneo, Terence, ed. Religion in the Liberal Polity. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 2005.
    • A collection of essays on religion, rights, public deliberation, and related topics.
  • Dagger, Richard. Civic Virtues: Rights, Citizenship, and Republican Liberalism. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1997.
  • Dante. De monarchia. Tr. Prue Shaw. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • Book 3 of this work concerns the relation (and division) between Church and State.
  • Eberle, Christopher J. Religious Convictions in Liberal Politics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002
    • A thorough critique of the varieties of exclusivism.
  • Eliot, T. S. “Catholicism and International Order.” Essays, Ancient and Modern. London: Faber and Faber, 1936.
  • Eliot, T. S. “The Idea of a Christian Society” and “Notes Toward the Definition of Culture.” Christianity and Culture. New York: Harcourt Brace & Company, 1967.
  • Gaus, Gerald F. Justificatory Liberalism: An Essay on Epistemology and Political Theory. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Gaus, Gerald F. “The Place of Religious Belief in Liberal Politics.” In Multiculturalism and Moral Conflict, edited by Maria Dimova-Cookson. London: Routledge, 2008.
  • Greenawalt, Kent. Religious Convictions and Political Choice. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1991.
  • Greenawalt, Kent. Private Consciences and Public Reasons. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995.
  • Gutmann, Amy. Democratic Education. Rev. ed. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1999.
  • Gutmann, Amy. Identity in Democracy. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 2003.
    • Includes a helpful chapter on religious identity in politics.
  • Hobbes, Thomas. Leviathan. Ed. Edwin Curley. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Co., 1994.
  • Kymlicka, Will. Multicultural Citizenship: A Liberal Theory of Minority Rights. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995.
  • Kymlicka, Will. Contemporary Political Philosophy: An Introduction. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002.
    • A fine introduction to the field, useful for beginners but detailed enough to interest experienced readers.
  • Larmore, Charles. Patterns of Moral Complexity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1987.
  • Locke, John. A Letter Concerning Toleration. Ed. James Tully. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Co., 1983.
  • Macedo, Stephen. Diversity and Distrust: Civic Education in a Multicultural Democracy. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2003.
    • Contains extensive discussion of religion and liberal civic education.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. After Virtue: A Study in Moral Theory. 2nd ed. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1984.
    • An influential critique of modernity and the philosophies which (he argues) have given rise to it.
  • Mozert v. Hawkins County Board of Education. Nos. 86-6144, 86-6179, and 87-5024. United States Court of Appeals, Sixth Circuit. July 9, 1987.
    • Landmark federal case concerning parental religious objections to particular forms of education.
  • Neuhaus, Richard John. The Naked Public Square: Religion and Democracy in America. Grand Rapids, MI: Wm. B Eerdmans, 1986.
    • An influential book among religious conservatives and neoconservatives.
  • Okin, Susan Moller, Is Multiculturalism Bad for Women? Ed. Joshua Cohen, Matthew Howard, and Martha C. Nussbaum. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1999.
    • Parts of the discussion in this book concern the status of women in religious minorities.
  • Perry, Michael J. Under God?: Religious Faith and Liberal Democracy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • Rawls, John. A Theory of Justice. Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press, 1971.
  • Rawls, John. Political Liberalism.New York: Columbia University Press, 1996.
  • Rawls, John. “The Idea of Public Reason Revisited.” The Law of Peoples. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1999.
  • Rorty, Richard. Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.
  • Rorty, Richard. “Religion as Conversation-stopper.” Philosophy and Social Hope. New York: Penguin Putnam, Inc., 1999.
  • Sandel, Michael J. Democracy’s Discontent: America in Search of a Public Philosophy. Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press, 1996.
  • Sandel, Michael J. Liberalism and the Limits of Justice. Rev. ed. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
    • A thorough critique of Rawlsian liberalism from a broadly communitarian perspective, although Sandel has tended to resist that label.
  • Scruton, Roger. The Meaning of Conservatism. Harmondsworth: Penguin, 1980.
  • Stout, Jeffrey. Democracy and Tradition. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 2003.
  • Talisse, Robert B. Democracy After Liberalism: Pragmatism and Deliberative Politics. London: Routledge Press, 2004.
  • Weithman, Paul J., ed. Religion and Contemporary Liberalism. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1997.
    • This collection of essays concerns many aspects of the intersection of religion and politics.
  • Weithman, Paul J.. Religion and the Obligations of Citizenship. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
    • Argues that religion has positive contributions to make toward civic ends.
  • Wisconsin v. Yoder. Nos. 70-110. United States Supreme Court. May 15, 1972.
    • An important case concerning the right of Amish parents to exempt their children from the requirement to attend school up to a specified age.

Author Information

Christopher Callaway
Saint Joseph’s College of Maine
U. S. A.

Benedict de Spinoza: Political Philosophy

spinozaThe body of Benedict de Spinoza’s writings on political philosophy in the 17th century should be seen as a paradigmatic species of European Enlightenment Philosophy. Spinoza rejected the teleological account of human nature and its implications to political societies in favor of rational, scientific understanding with its contractual implications. Hence, political societies to Spinoza are not natural organisms but artificial entities “designed” and “manufactured” by human beings for certain ends. Such designs are, however, constrained by an understanding of human nature. It is, indeed, Spinoza’s conception of human nature that forms the foundation for his political philosophy.One of the aims of Spinoza’s political writings is to demonstrate that, given the central role played by emotions in human motivations, political authority is a necessary evil. Human beings, as they are, are not the kind of beings capable of surviving without it. In addition, Spinoza does not think that politics are good for much more besides keeping us from chaos, murder, anarchy. In this, he is in agreement with Thomas Hobbes. On the other hand, if Spinoza affirms security as the fundamental political value, as will be argued, he does not necessarily think that such a value is consistent only with a certain form of government. In this he differs from Hobbes.

It is only once we understand Spinoza’s picture of what human beings are like, particularly the source of their motivations, that we are in a position to derive the ends of political societies, which in turn leads us to explain the sources and justification of political authority, and why Spinoza is ultimately non-committal as to the kind of political form best embodying the endorsed fundamental political values.

Table of Contents

  1. Human Nature
    1. Interpretation of the Conatus Principle
    2. Ethical Egoism and the Salience of Passions
  2. The Necessity for Political Authority: State of Nature
    1. Objective Account
    2. Psychological Account
  3. The Transition from State of Nature to Political Authority: The Social Contract
    1. Civil vs. Natural Rights in Locke
    2. Civil vs. Natural Rights in Spinoza
    3. Transfer of Powers or Abilities
  4. Obligations
    1. Citizens
    2. Sovereign
  5. The Purpose and Preferred Form of Political Authority
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Human Nature

Spinoza’s political philosophy proceeds from the idea, also found in Hobbes, that political ends, or goals, should be derived from understanding human nature such as it is, and not as it should or could be. This fundamental starting point can be contrasted with a utopian tradition of political philosophy emblematic, for example, in Plato’s Republic and the early writings of Karl Marx. While utopian political philosophers argue that correct political institutions can transform human nature into something more desirable or virtuous than its current state, Spinoza instead commences with a contrarian conviction, by and large rejecting such a possibility. This conviction proceeds from Spinoza’s interpretation of human nature.

a. Interpretation of the Conatus Principle

Human nature, according to Spinoza, must be studied and understood just like the nature of any other organism in the universe, in the following sense; human beings are subsumed in nature along with all other natural organisms and cannot thus transcend, and are therefore subject to, natural laws. This includes our nature as physiological beings and as psychological and cognitive beings. Furthermore, the laws of nature are to be understood, according to Spinoza, in a non-teleological fashion. Nature/God does not act with an end in view; hence, human nature cannot be derived from any such purposes. Instead, the most fundamental principle guiding all organisms, and therefore also human beings is what Spinoza calls the Conatus Principle:

Each thing, as far as it can by its own power, strives to persevere in being. (E:III:P6)

While it is not immediately obvious how Spinoza intends to support this principle when it comes to the kinds of organisms called human beings—particularly in the context of political philosophy—it later becomes clear that the principle, in its current and descriptive, form, is intended epistemologically as an a priori analytic proposition, or a necessary truth:

Since reason demands nothing contrary to Nature, it demands that everyone love himself, seek his own advantage, what is really useful to him, want what will really lead a man to greater perfection, and absolutely, that everyone should strive to preserve his own being as far as he can. This, indeed, is as necessarily true as that the whole is greater than its part. (E: IV:P18S)

Hence, the Conatus principle, when applied in the context of human beings, appears to describe human beings as egoistic beings. This, as stated, is intended as a truth not based upon empirical observation or self-reflection, but put forth as a necessary truth—a truth as necessary as the truth that the whole is greater than its part. According to the descriptive interpretation of the principle (E:III:P6), we are necessarily egoistic creatures. However, the quoted passage from (E:IV:P18S) also gives credence to a prescriptive understanding of the Conatus principle, for Spinoza says that “everyone should strive to preserve his own being as far as he can.” On this reading, we should always act according to our self-interest. This position is known as ethical egoism since it urges us to be egoists rather than describing us as already being egoists.

Now, if both of these interpretations of the Conatus Principle are plausible, then we need an answer to the following question: If the descriptive interpretation tells us that we are necessarily actuated by the Principle, then why bother prescribing this action as desirable? That is, if we already necessarily act in accordance with the descriptive version of the Conatus Principle, then why are we also urged to act this way? Urging us to do something we already necessarily do is surely redundant.

One way out of this dilemma might be to say that the prescriptive version of the Conatus Principle is necessary because we do not, in fact, in all circumstances, act in accordance with our self-interest. Because we do not do so, Spinoza is urging us to do so. This interpretation would certainly be in agreement with the empirical reality of human motivations. We certainly do not always act in ways that are conducive to the sustenance and enhancement of our being. Self-sacrificing behavior, such as sacrificing one’s life for one’s family, friend, or nation is all too familiar. Surely Spinoza was aware of such actions. But if this is true, then why advance the descriptive version of the Conatus Principle at all? After all, if it can be refuted through empirical counterexamples, then isn’t this enough to show that this version of the principle is simply false? But Spinoza does not, as we have seen, advance the principle as an a posteriori truth, but as an a priori truth. Hence offering empirical counterexamples appears to be beside the point, and offering this way out of the dilemma will thus not do. But if it is indeed true, that we do not always act in accordance with our self-interest, then just what is the force and the meaning of the a priori descriptive version of the Conatus principle?

Perhaps the solution is to say that the prescriptive version of the Conatus principle is intended to us human beings as empirical, affective beings while the descriptive version of the principle is intended for what humanity could look like, if ideally rational. So, on this reading, Spinoza is urging us to act according to the dictates of ethical egoism since we, as empirical beings primarily motivated by our desires, sometimes fail to do so. This does not change the fact that we do act according to the principles of self-interest more often than not; it simply means that we do not always know what is in our best interest—since we are not ideally rational.

If this is plausible, then the descriptive version of the principle could indeed be interpreted as a metaphysical truth necessarily true for ideal humans, and not as a psychological truth. Fully rational individuals will never fail to seek whatever aids or enhances their being. But this would not be the case for beings like us, who need to be exhorted into self-interested behavior. If this is correct, the descriptive version of the principle describes human beings in their ideal state while the prescriptive version of the principle is designed for humans in their current state. Therefore, it is the prescriptive version of the Conatus Principle that is mainly of importance for the purposes of political philosophy.

b. Ethical Egoism and the Salience of Passions

If the prescriptive interpretation of the Conatus Principle is correct for all imperfect human beings, then Spinoza is pressing us to act in accordance with our best interests. This is not, however, tantamount to telling us to act selfishly or to see ourselves as individualistic, non-social beings. In fact, it is Spinoza’s thesis that acting in a selfish or individualistic manner is not in our best interest and hence a violation of the dictates of the Conatus Principle. And the reason why humans do not see what is in their best interests is due to the centrality of passions in their very being:

But human nature is framed in a different fashion: every one, indeed, seeks his own interest, but does not do so in accordance with the dictates of sound reason, for most men’s ideas of desirability and usefulness are guided by their fleshly instincts and emotions, which take no thought beyond the present and immediate object. (TP: V:72-73)

On the other hand, acting according to the Conatus Principle—and hence in one’s best interest--is to act in accordance with the dictates of sound reason. And to act in accordance with the dictates of sound reason is to realize the impossibility of persevering in one’s being without mutual assistance. Providing mutual assistance is in the best interest of human beings. Indeed, Spinoza argues that it is necessary for even providing the basic needs for survival (TP:V:73). Spinoza wants us to act in accordance with the principle of ethical egoism while arguing that it is precisely this that we are not capable of doing because of our “fleshy instincts and emotions” which run fundamentally counter to the social dictates of reason.

The anti-social nature of our passions is also an inevitable source of conflict:

In so far as men are tormented by anger, envy, or any passion implying hatred, they are drawn asunder and made contrary one to another, and therefore are so much the more to be feared, as they are more powerful, crafty, and cunning than the other animals. And because men are in the highest degree liable to these passions, therefore men are naturally enemies. (PT: II: 296)

This emphasis on the passions as the cause for conflict implies that ideally, if guided by full reason, human beings might be capable of avoiding conflict. Again, to act fully in accordance with the dictates of reason is to avoid conflict as was demonstrated above. Conflict does not enhance one’s being; quite to the contrary—it can annihilate one’s being. So, the emphasis on Spinoza’s ethical egoism is on the “ethical” since such behavior, instead of resulting in conflict, would embrace the social values of stability and harmony.

2. The Necessity for Political Authority: State of Nature

a. Objective Account

Spinoza’s description of human beings as “natural enemies,” and the consequent inevitability of conflict is an account of the human condition in a state of nature. This is mostly a non-historical, “conceptual device” used to depict the human condition in the absence of political authority. While Spinoza’s use of it is unsystematic compared to Hobbes and Locke, he nevertheless presumes something like it, and argues, along with Hobbes and Locke, that political authority is necessary for the survival of human societies: “[n]o society can exist without government, and force, and laws to restrain and repress men’s desires and immoderate impulses.” (TP:V: 74). Again, it is our affective nature that gets us into trouble. Since human beings are motivated by their self-interested desires for which they seek immediate gratification, they cannot exist without government. Thus, Spinoza rejects the possibility of anarchism for human beings primarily motivated by their desires as we have seen, this is not necessarily the case for fully rational beings).

Spinoza’s account here closely resembles that of Hobbes who similarly argued that human life without political authority would be undesirable due to the nature of human desires. Famously, such a life would be “solitary, poor, nasty, brutish, and short.” (Leviathan: I: xiii, p. 76). Spinoza also significantly agrees with Hobbes that it is the individual who decides what is in his or her best interest in a given situation and can hence procure his or her interests by force, cunning, entreaty or any other means (TP: XVI: 202).

b. Psychological Account

Third-person explanations of why political authority would be necessary for creatures like us has not yet to offer a first-person explanation, from the point of view of the very individuals in state of nature, of why they would actually prefer living under conditions of political authority rather than under the conditions of anarchy. Spinoza’s explanation of this proceeds from what he regards as self-evident, axiomatic laws of human psychology.

Spinoza argues that no one ever neglects what he regards as good, except with the hope of gaining something even better, or for the fear of some greater evil; and no one ever endures and evil, except for the sake of even greater evil, or gaining something good (TP: XVI: 203). The corollary of this is that all of us, given a choice of two goods, choose the one we think is the greatest and, given a choice of two evils, choose the least evil. When we combine this axiom with the Conatus Principle, we can see that we determine what is good and what is evil for us by judging what is most or least conducive to our survival.

Now, Spinoza argues, based upon this psychological axiom, that we would forsake the state of nature in favor of some form of political authority, because we would judge the situation under political authority to be a greater good (or a lesser evil) than the state of nature. But why would we judge the affair this way? Why not favor the state of nature over political authority? While Spinoza is not explicit regarding this matter, he nevertheless alludes to the fact that it is worse—again, from the point of view of our survival—to be at the mercy of innumerable individuals than at the mercy of one single entity: the state (TP: XVI: 202-3). Admittedly, this seems far from obvious as Locke argued later, but Spinoza might defend this conclusion on the grounds that dispersion of potential evil is more difficult to countenance than a concentration of potential evil. At least, in this way, while one may not necessarily be able to do anything about it, one can at least know where the potential evil is coming from.

3. The Transition from State of Nature to Political Authority: The Social Contract

It is clear, from the foregoing, that Spinoza’s rejection of anarchy is based upon the conjunction of the Conatus Principle and his psychological axiom. It is also clear that political authority for Spinoza is not something intrinsically good or desirable, but a necessary evil. It is the least evil choice of two evils. By utilizing the “state of nature” device, Spinoza is also implicitly conceding that the state is not a natural organism but an artificial entity “designed” and “manufactured” by human beings. While these considerations answer the ontological status of the state and why political authority is necessary at all, it is still necessary to see what Spinoza’s view is on the transfer of power from the state-of-nature-individuals to the state. Here it is perhaps useful to illuminate Spinoza’s position by briefly contrasting it to another social contract theorist, John Locke.

a. Civil vs. Natural Rights in Locke

Locke held that the state of nature was conditioned by what he called “law of nature” and that these natural laws could be discovered by reason. Two of the most important natural laws for our comparative purposes, mentioned by Locke, were (a) that no one ought to harm another in his or her life, health, liberty, or possessions; and (b) that should such violations occur, everyone had the right to punish the transgressor(s). The first of these laws indicate that human beings in state of nature possess rights to life, health, liberty, and possessions, and that it is wrong to violate such rights. So, while the state of nature for Locke is non-political, it is far from being non-moral: moral terms and actions are applicable in the non-political, state-of-nature realm. Now, while human beings can and do sometimes act morally in the state of nature, Locke also recognizes that often this will not be the case, and because of this, the survival of the individual is much more likely under a political authority which would possess a monopoly on punishment. So, according to Locke, humans still retain their rights to life, health, liberty, and possessions (this is collective called “property” in Locke’s theory) in the political realm. Such natural rights are now expressed through the form of civil rights in positive law. So, the distinction between natural and civil rights in Locke is derived from the distinction between natural law and positive law. Furthermore, it is clear that Locke regards such rights as moral constraints on the political realm; there are natural moral limits to what the state can do.

In contrast to our retention of the natural rights to property expressed through civil laws, we do not retain our right to punish the transgressors of property rights according to Locke. Instead, it is precisely our abrogation of the right to punish which is transferred to a state that makes the political realm possible.

b. Civil vs. Natural Rights in Spinoza

Unlike Locke, Spinoza makes no distinction between natural law and civil law, nor the corollary derivatives of natural rights and civil rights. Spinoza undermines such distinctions by arguing that “right” is simply synonymous with any agent’s “power” or “ability.” So, for Spinoza, to say that someone has a natural right to life, liberty, health, and possessions, is just to say that someone has a power to preserve their life, liberty, health, and possessions—to the best of their ability. In other words, our “right” to self-preservation is coextensive with our “power” or with our “ability” for self-preservation; “…the rights of an individual extend to the utmost limits of its power as it has been conditioned [by nature].” (TP: XVI: 200)

Denying such a distinction already foreshadows Spinoza’s refusal to regard the state of nature in Lockean terms, as a non-political but moral sphere. Instead, Spinoza is insistent that the state of nature is both a non-political and a non-moral sphere; “The state of nature…must be conceived as without either religion or law, and consequently without sin or wrong” (TP: XVI: 210). So, moral terms proper, such as “right,” “wrong,” “just,” and “unjust” are inconceivable in the state of nature. It is not just that there are no limits to what we can do to one another in state of nature; it is also the case that ordinary moral terms do not possess any meaning. Hence, it follows from that that “the right and ordinance of nature, under which all men are born, and under which they mostly live, only prohibits such things as no one desires, and no one can attain: it does not forbid strife, nor hatred, nor anger, nor deceit, nor indeed, any of the means suggested by desire…” (TP: XVI: 202).

To use Spinoza’s parlance, everyone has a “right” to act deceitfully, angrily, discordantly, violently, etc. towards others, or in general, in whatever manner they see fit as long as they are able to do so; their rights are only limited by their ability. As such, the only things we do not have a “right” to in the state of nature are things that none of us wants anyway, or things that are impossible for us to attain.

c. Transfer of Powers or Abilities

Although Spinoza would agree with Locke that the reasons for forsaking the state of nature comes from potentially enhanced capacities for self-preservation under political authority, it is less clear how Spinoza accounts for this transition. At first blush, it looks as if Spinoza is simply offering a story very similar to Locke’s: the political realm is made possible by the transference of our natural rights to punish. In this case, the use of force would belong solely to the state, just as it does in Locke’s account. However, as explained earlier, this right is conceived by Spinoza in manner very different from that of Locke. For while Locke thinks that the right to punish the transgressor of one’s rights is a natural, moral right, having nothing necessarily to do with whether one in fact is capable of punishing or not, in Spinoza’s conceptual apparatus this right is, once again, synonymous with one’s power or ability to punish the transgressor. One only has the “right” to the extent that one possesses the power. In other words, no ability or capacity, no “right.” Due to Spinoza’s identification of “right” and “power,” the transition from the non-political and the non-moral-state-of-nature to the political and moral sphere of the state does not appear to take place through the abrogation of our “right” to punish, as it does in Locke. Rather, if the interpretation is correct, Spinoza is committed to the position that, instead of our natural moral rights, we are in fact transferring our powers or capacities.

But there is a sense in which this is hardly intelligible. For one can argue that “powers” or “abilities” or “capacities” are not the kinds of things that is possible to transfer. One’s capacity to walk, for example, cannot be transferred to another in the sense that once the transfer has taken place, the agent having transferred the capacity no longer is able to walk while the agent having received the capacity now is able to walk. One can only lose one’s capacity (for example, when one is dead) but not transfer it. The same considerations are applicable to one’s capacity to defend oneself: one can lose that capacity but not transfer it. So, Spinoza’s identification of “right” with one’s power or ability does not seem to allow him to make the concept of transferring this “right” intelligible.

A distinction between “power” and the “use-of-power” is necessary. With such a distinction, Spinoza could make the transition from state of nature to a political sphere more plausible since he could now concede that while one cannot indeed transfer “powers” or “capacities,” one can nevertheless transfer one’s use of those powers and capacities. On this interpretation, the Lockean rights to life, liberty, health, and possession, would be understood by Spinoza not as one’s ability to defend or enhance one’s rights, liberties, health, and possessions, but instead as the actual use of that ability.

4. Obligations

The notion of obligations in Spinoza is relevant only in the political realm, not in the state of nature since, as we have seen, the state of nature for Spinoza is not only a nonpolitical but also a non-moral realm. The orthodox story about obligations tells us they are customarily derived from either voluntary agreements or someone having certain rights. Thus, if two parties voluntary agree to a contract, e.g. marriage, then the two parties incur obligations stipulated in the contract; or, for example, if someone has a right to free speech, then it is everybody’s obligation not to interfere with that someone’s right. That is the traditional story. But since Spinoza has argued that rights are synonymous with power, his story about obligations is anything but traditional. We shall take a look at obligations with respect to the relation between citizens and the sovereign.

a. Citizens

Spinoza stated that all contracts or promises derive their obligations from utility. Utility or disutility of a contract, in turn, is decided by the application of the aforementioned psychological axiom which tells us that no one ever neglects what he regards as good, except with the hope of gaining something even better, or for the fear of some greater evil; and no one ever endures and evil, except for the sake of even greater evil, or gaining something good. According to Spinoza, we have an obligation to fulfill a contract only if the violation of the contract would not gain us something better, or if the violation of the contract would result in a greater evil. If either or both conditions hold, then we a “right” to violate the contract (TP:XVI:203-205). The implication of such an analysis is, at the very least, that all contracts are revocable at any time, subject to the kind of analysis stated.

Now, with respect to the specific contract in question here, the contract to transfer our use of power to a given political authority, the implication is clear: the citizen’s “obligation” to obey the authority is also contingent on the psychological axiom. “It is…foolish to ask a man to keep his faith with us forever, unless we also endeavour that the violation of the compact we enter into shall involve for the violator more harm than good” (TP:XVI:204). Spinoza, then, offers a decisive “right” to rebellion for citizens.

Spinoza’s equation of “right” to power also has implications to the issue of citizens’ obligations. If the “right” of the sovereign is also coextensive to its power, then it would seem to follow that the citizens’ obligations extend only so far as the power of the sovereign. One is “obligated” to obey the sovereign only if one does not have the power to disobey it.

b. Sovereign

Presumably the obligations and the rights of the sovereign (there is here no presupposition as to the preferred form of government—that topic is discussed later—so that by “sovereign” one could mean a democracy, monarchy, oligarchy, etc.) is subject to similar analysis as the obligations and rights of the citizens. Since the citizens’ “rights” are coextensive with their power, the sovereign’s “obligations” to the citizens are limited only by the power of both parties. On the other hand, the sovereign’s “rights” are also only limited by the powers of the respective parties. Hence, the sovereign has the right to do whatever it wants, and wherever it meets the counterforce of the citizens, there lay its obligations. Furthermore, Spinoza is also clear that the sovereign’s power is not limited by laws, but only by its intellectual and physical abilities. There are no constitutional limitations to the sovereign’s actions.

Needless to say, these are devastating implications from the point of view of individual freedom, but Spinoza is quick to point out that both the citizens and the sovereign are constrained by the Conatus Principle as well. Therefore, a sovereign concerned to advance its being will rarely impose “irrational” commands toward the citizens, because…”they are bound to consult their own interests, and retain their power by consulting the public good and acting according to the dictates of reason…(TP:XVI:205). Presumably, similar things can be asserted about the citizenry, given the caveat that they also act in accordance with the dictates of reason. However, the problem with this sort of argument is that we have already seen Spinoza’s reservations regarding the ability of humans to act in accordance with the dictates of reason, and even if this was plausible, the force of Spinoza’s argument here is purely speculative. In other words, Spinoza is not making a principled point but arguing, instead, that the kinds of irrational commands (perhaps “tyrannical” would be better) would not likely occur since the sovereign will act in accordance with his or her best interests. But this sort of argument can surely only be assessed through empirical means by consulting the available historical record regarding the purported rationality of sovereigns’ behavior, and such a record has not been kind to Spinoza’s speculative point.

These kinds of considerations demonstrate, among other things, Spinoza’s unorthodox and perhaps incoherent use of the concepts like “rights,” “obligations,” and even “contract.” After all, what exactly does the social contract that Spinoza employs accomplish since its force does not come from the contract itself but rather from the kind of cost-benefit analysis carried out by the psychological axiom? What exactly would be lost from Spinoza’s political philosophy if the notion of contract and its correlative notions were simply omitted?

5. The Purpose and Preferred Form of Political Authority

Explaining Spinoza’s political philosophy has so far concentrated on his view of the relevant features of human psychology to political theory. Humans are creatures driven by passions and desires for survival that will always be characterized by hope for something better and fear for something worse. Hence, as has been explained, none of us ever neglects what he regards as good, except with the hope of gaining something even better, or for the fear of some greater evil; and none of us ever endures an evil, except for the sake of even greater evil, or gaining something good (TP: XVI: 203). Because of these fundamental features of human psychology, we would judge the state of nature to be a greater evil, or as something worse, than living under political authority. But what exactly does the political realm offer us that we cannot enjoy without it? What is the purpose of the political realm?

One answer to this question can be gathered from the account so far. We enter into the political realm in order to secure/enhance our existence better than we could without it—given the central role of passions in our nature. This is no less than a Hobbesian answer; the purpose of the political realm is escaping perpetual war in order to secure our lives and material possessions. Spinoza confirms this view: “…for the ends of every social organization and commonwealth are…security and comfort” (TP: III: 47). To reiterate, a good society is one which will be “most secure, most stable, and least liable to reverses…” (TP: III: 46). Spinoza appears to assert security as the fundamental political value. Such an affirmation can be contrasted, on the one hand, with political thinkers like Plato, Aristotle, and Hegel, all of whom saw the realm of politics as essential to the moral realization of the individual and, on the other hand, with thinkers like Locke and Kant who emphasized the instrumental nature of the state in guaranteeing individual freedom.

In spite of these explicit pronouncements on behalf of security by Spinoza, the issue of the purpose of political authority remains controversial in Spinoza scholarship. There are many commentators who do not interpret Spinoza as a Hobbesian with respect to the ends of political authority, but instead read him either as an advocate of individual freedom or moral perfection, or perhaps as both. One of the common threads to all of these accounts is Spinoza’s alleged preference for democracy as a political form. It is argued that because Spinoza advocates democracy and the democratic political rule is most conducive to freedom or perhaps virtue, that Spinoza is therefore affirming either freedom or virtue as the fundamental political value.

There is some textual as well as inferential evidence for such views. For example, Spinoza explicitly announces democracy as the most consonant with individual liberty; “I think I have now shown sufficiently clearly the basis of a democracy: I have especially desired to do so, for I believe it to be of all forms of government the most natural, and the most consonant with individual liberty” (TP: XVI: 207). Also, because Spinoza sees only de facto human beings as motivated by their passions and self-interested desires, and claims that human beings are potentially capable of being guided by reason which dictates cooperative behavior, perhaps it is the role of politics to nudge us from the irrational, passionate creatures to rational creatures by inculcation of virtue. Either way, the argument goes, security for Spinoza is only an instrumental value, or a necessary condition for the true political ends of individual freedom or virtue.

However, while commenting on the absolute obligation to obey existing laws, Spinoza entertains an objection that his philosophy is turning subjects into slaves which sheds light to the controversy at hand. Spinoza rejects the objection as unfounded because real—or true—freedom is not freedom from the laws of the sovereign, no matter how oppressive such laws might be, but real freedom is to live “under the entire guidance of reason” (TP: XVI: 206). Indeed, Spinoza claims that freedom is specifically a private, not a political virtue while “…the virtue of the state is its security” (PT: I: 290).

But to live under the entire guidance of reason is, at least minimally, to control one’s unruly passions, whatever else it may also be. However, if this is the case, then the pressing political question must be to ask, what political form, if any, is best for achieving this kind of liberation? And the suggestion here is that there is no obvious answer to this question. One might, for example, think that an authoritarian regime might be able to restrain humans’ irrational desires more effectively than a democratic one. Or, alternatively, one might think that no political regime of any kind is necessary or sufficient for this kind of realization. So, one cannot easily claim that because Spinoza is an advocate of democracy, he is thereby accepting freedom or virtue as the fundamental political end.

There is also textual evidence for the view that Spinoza does not reject other forms of government in favor of democracy. One of the central aims of A Political Treatise is precisely to demonstrate how different forms of governments can meet the fundamental political value of stability. For example, Spinoza explains that, historically, monarchies have enjoyed the most stability of any form of government (PT: VI:317), and that their potential instability results from the divergent interests between the sovereign and the citizens. In light of this, Spinoza advises the sovereign to act in his or her own interests which is to act in the interests of the citizensIn the case of aristocracy, instability is said to result from inequality of political power among the ruling aristocrats, the remedy for which consists of equalizing such power as far as possible. Spinoza’s considered thoughts on the stability of democracy were interrupted by his untimely death, but while he thought it most consistent with freedom, he nevertheless regarded it as the most unstable of all political forms. Indeed, Spinoza comments that democracies naturally evolve into aristocracies, and aristocracies naturally evolve into monarchies. At least on one understanding of “natural,” democracies may be interpreted as less natural than aristocracies and monarchies (PT: VIII: 351).

If stability, as has been argued, is the fundamental political value for Spinoza, then many forms of government are consistent with it, and monarchies and aristocracies appear more stable than democracies.

6. Conclusion

Spinoza’s political philosophy is a logical extension of his view of human nature. To understand ends, sources, and justification of political authority, one does well to begin with the Conatus Principle and the associated psychological axioms employed by Spinoza. The source of problems for Spinoza’s political theory, specifically the moral notions of “contract,” “rights,” and “obligations” can also be traced to his view of human nature. But what needs to be adjusted? Are the problems in the political theory an indication that Spinoza’s view of human nature needs to amended, or is his view of humanity unassailable and the problems in political theory simply a part of the package?

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Hobbes, Thomas, Leviathan, ed. Edwin Curley, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1994.
  • Locke, John, Second Treatise of Government, ed. C.B. Macpherson, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1980.
  • Spinoza, Benedict de, A Theologico-Political Treatise and A Political Treatise, trans. R.H.M. Elwes, New York: Dover, 1951.
    • The references to the first work cited in the text as TP, chapter, page. References to the second work cited as PT, chapter, page.
  • Spinoza, Benedict de, Ethics, trans. R.H.M Elwes, New York: Dover, 1955.
    • All references to this work cited in the text as E, part, proposition.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Feuer, Lewis Samuel, Spinoza and the Rise of Liberalism, New Brunswick: Transaction Books, 1958.
  • McShea, Robert J, The Political Philosophy of Spinoza, New York: Columbia University, 1968.
  • Negri, Antonio, The Savage Anomaly: The Power of Spinoza’s Methaphysics and Politics, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota, 1991.
  • Rosen, Stanley, “Benedict Spinoza” in History of Political Philosophy, eds. Leo Strauss, Robert Cropsey, Chicago: University of Chicago, 1987.

Author Information

Jari Niemi
Florida Atlantic University
U. S. A.


libertyWhat it means to be a "libertarian" in a political sense is a contentious issue, especially among libertarians themselves. There is no single theory that can be safely identified as the libertarian theory, and probably no single principle or set of principles on which all libertarians can agree. Nevertheless, there is a certain family resemblance among libertarian theories that can serve as a framework for analysis. Although there is much disagreement about the details, libertarians are generally united by a rough agreement on a cluster of normative principles, empirical generalizations, and policy recommendations. Libertarians are committed to the belief that individuals, and not states or groups of any other kind, are both ontologically and normatively primary; that individuals have rights against certain kinds of forcible interference on the part of others; that liberty, understood as non-interference, is the only thing that can be legitimately demanded of others as a matter of legal or political right; that robust property rights and the economic liberty that follows from their consistent recognition are of central importance in respecting individual liberty; that social order is not at odds with but develops out of individual liberty; that the only proper use of coercion is defensive or to rectify an error; that governments are bound by essentially the same moral principles as individuals; and that most existing and historical governments have acted improperly insofar as they have utilized coercion for plunder, aggression, redistribution, and other purposes beyond the protection of individual liberty.

In terms of political recommendations, libertarians believe that most, if not all, of the activities currently undertaken by states should be either abandoned or transferred into private hands. The most well-known version of this conclusion finds expression in the so-called "minimal state" theories of Robert Nozick, Ayn Rand, and others (Nozick 1974; Rand 1963a, 1963b) which hold that states may legitimately provide police, courts, and a military, but nothing more. Any further activity on the part of the state—regulating or prohibiting the sale or use of drugs, conscripting individuals for military service, providing taxpayer-funded support to the poor, or even building public roads—is itself rights-violating and hence illegitimate.

Libertarian advocates of a strictly minimal state are to be distinguished from two closely related groups, who favor a smaller or greater role for government, and who may or may not also label themselves "libertarian." On one hand are so-called anarcho-capitalists who believe that even the minimal state is too large, and that a proper respect for individual rights requires the abolition of government altogether and the provision of protective services by private markets. On the other hand are those who generally identify themselves as classical liberals. Members of this group tend to share libertarians' confidence in free markets and skepticism over government power, but are more willing to allow greater room for coercive activity on the part of the state so as to allow, say, state provision of public goods or even limited tax-funded welfare transfers.

Table of Contents

  1. The Diversity of Libertarian Theories
  2. Natural Rights Libertarianism
    1. Historical Roots: Locke
    2. Contemporary Natural Rights: Nozick
    3. Criticisms of Natural Rights Libertarianism
      1. Principle of Self-Ownership
      2. Derivation of Full Private Property Ownership from Self-Ownership
  3. Consequentialist Libertarianism
    1. Quantitative Utilitarianism
      1. The Tragedy of the Commons and Private Property
      2. The Invisible Hand and Free Exchange
      3. Arguments Against Government Intervention
    2. Traditionalist Consequentialism
    3. Criticisms of Consequentialist Libertarianism
  4. Anarcho-Capitalism
  5. Other Approaches to Libertarianism
    1. Teleological Libertarianism
    2. Contractarian Libertarianism
    3. Conclusion: Libertarianism as an Overlapping Consensus
  6. References and Further Reading

1. The Diversity of Libertarian Theories

As this article will use the term, libertarianism is a theory about the proper role of government that can be, and has been, supported on a number of different metaphysical, epistemological, and moral grounds. Some libertarians are theists who believe that the doctrine follows from a God-made natural law. Others are atheists who believe it can be supported on purely secular grounds. Some libertarians are rationalists who deduce libertarian conclusions from axiomatic first principles. Others derive their libertarianism from empirical generalizations or a reliance on evolved tradition. And when it comes to comprehensive moral theories, libertarians represent an almost exhaustive array of positions. Some are egoists who believe that individuals have no natural duties to aid their fellow human beings, while others adhere to moral doctrines that hold that the better-off have significant duties to improve the lot of the worse-off. Some libertarians are deontologists, while others are consequentialists, contractarians, or virtue-theorists. Understanding libertarianism as a narrow, limited thesis about the proper moral standing, and proper zone of activity, of the state—and not a comprehensive ethical or metaphysical doctrine—is crucial to making sense of this otherwise baffling diversity of broader philosophic positions.

This article will focus primarily on libertarianism as a philosophic doctrine. This means that, rather than giving close scrutiny to the important empirical claims made both in support and criticism of libertarianism, it will focus instead on the metaphysical, epistemological, and especially moral claims made by the discussants. Those interested in discussions of the non-philosophical aspects of libertarianism can find some recommendations in the reference list below.

Furthermore, this article will focus almost exclusively on libertarian arguments regarding just two philosophical subjects: distributive justice and political authority. There is a danger that this narrow focus will be misleading, since it ignores a number of interesting and important arguments that libertarians have made on subjects ranging from free speech to self-defense, to the proper social treatment of the mentally ill. More generally, it ignores the ways in which libertarianism is a doctrine of social or civil liberty, and not just one of economic liberty. For a variety of reasons, however, the philosophic literature on libertarianism has mostly ignored these other aspects of the theory, and so this article, as a summary of that literature, will generally reflect that trend.

2. Natural Rights Libertarianism

Probably the most well-known and influential version of libertarianism, at least among academic philosophers, is that based upon a theory of natural rights. Natural rights theories vary, but are united by a common belief that individuals have certain moral rights simply by virtue of their status as human beings, that these rights exist prior to and logically independent of the existence of government, and that these rights constrain the ways in which it is morally permissible for both other individuals and governments to treat individuals.

a. Historical Roots: Locke

Although one can find some earlier traces of this doctrine among, for instance, the English Levellers or the Spanish School of Salamanca, John Locke's political thought is generally recognized as the most important historical influence on contemporary natural rights versions of libertarianism. The most important elements of Locke's theory in this respect, set out in his Second Treatise, are his beliefs about the law of nature, and his doctrine of property rights in external goods.

Locke's idea of the law of nature draws on a distinction between law and government that has been profoundly influential on the development of libertarian thought. According to Locke, even if no government existed over men, the state of nature would nevertheless not be a state of "license." In other words, men would still be governed by law, albeit one that does not originate from any political source (c.f. Hayek 1973, ch. 4). This law, which Locke calls the "law of nature" holds that "being all equal and independent, no one ought to harm another in his life, liberty, or possessions" (Locke 1952, para. 6). This law of nature serves as a normative standard to govern human conduct, rather than as a description of behavioral regularities in the world (as are other laws of nature like, for instance, the law of gravity). Nevertheless, it is a normative standard that Locke believes is discoverable by human reason, and that binds us all equally as rational agents.

Locke's belief in a prohibition on harming others stems from his more basic belief that each individual "has a property in his own person" (Locke 1952, para. 27). In other words, individuals are self-owners. Throughout this essay we will refer to this principle, which has been enormously influential on later libertarians, as the "self-ownership principle." Though controversial, it has generally been taken to mean that each individual possesses over her own body all those rights of exclusive use that we normally associate with property in external goods. But if this were all that individuals owned, their liberties and ability to sustain themselves would obviously be extremely limited. For almost anything we want to do—eating, walking, even breathing, or speaking in order to ask another's permission—involves the use of external goods such as land, trees, or air. From this, Locke concludes, we must have some way of acquiring property in those external goods, else they will be of no use to anyone. But since we own ourselves, Locke argues, we therefore also own our labor. And by "mixing" our labor with external goods, we can come to own those external goods too. This allows individuals to make private use of the world that God has given to them in common. There is a limit, however, to this ability to appropriate external goods for private use, which Locke captures in his famous "proviso" that holds that a legitimate act of appropriation must leave "enough, and as good... in common for others" (Locke 1952, para. 27). Still, even with this limit, the combination of time, inheritance, and differential abilities, motivation, and luck will lead to possibly substantial inequalities in wealth between persons, and Locke acknowledges this as an acceptable consequence of his doctrine (Locke 1952, para. 50).

b. Contemporary Natural Rights: Nozick

By far the single most important influence on the perception of libertarianism among contemporary academic philosophers was Robert Nozick in his book, Anarchy, State, and Utopia (1974). This book is an explanation and exploration of libertarian rights that attempts to show how a minimal, and no more than a minimal, state can arise via an "invisible hand" process out of a state of nature without violating the rights of individuals; to challenge the highly influential claims of John Rawls that purport to show that a more-than-minimal state was justified and required to achieve distributive justice; and to show that a regime of libertarian rights could establish a "framework for utopia" wherein different individuals would be free to seek out and create mediating institutions to help them achieve their own distinctive visions of the good life.

The details of Nozick's arguments can be found at Robert Nozick. Here, we will just briefly point out a few elements of particular importance in understanding Nozick's place in contemporary libertarian thought—his focus on the "negative" aspects of liberty and rights, his Kantian defense of rights, his historical theory of entitlement, and his acceptance of a modified Lockean proviso on property acquisition. A discussion of his argument for the minimal state can be found in the section on anarcho-capitalism below.

First, Nozick, like almost all natural rights libertarians, stresses negative liberties and rights above positive liberties and rights. The distinction between positive and negative liberty, made famous by Isaiah Berlin (Berlin 1990), is often thought of as a distinction between "freedom to" and "freedom from." One has positive liberty when one has the opportunity and ability to do what one wishes (or, perhaps, what one "rationally" wishes or "ought" to wish). One has negative liberty, on the other hand, when there is an absence of external interferences to one's doing what one wishes—specifically, when there is an absence of external interferences by other people. A person who is too sick to gather food has his negative liberty intact—no one is stopping him from gathering food—but not his positive liberty as he is unable to gather food even though he wants to do so. Nozick and most libertarians see the proper role of the state as protecting negative liberty, not as promoting positive liberty, and so toward this end Nozick focuses on negative rights as opposed to positive rights. Negative rights are claims against others to refrain from certain kinds of actions against you. Positive rights are claims against others to perform some sort of positive action. Rights against assault, for instance, are negative rights, since they simply require others not to assault you. Welfare rights, on the other hand, are positive rights insofar as they require others to provide you with money or services. By enforcing negative rights, the state protects our negative liberty. It is an empirical question whether enforcing merely negative rights or, as more left-liberal philosophers would promote, enforcing a mix of both negative and positive rights would better promote positive liberty.

Second, while Nozick agrees with the broadly Lockean picture of the content and government-independence of natural law and natural rights, his remarks in defense of those rights draw their inspiration more from Immanuel Kant than from Locke. Nozick does not provide a full-blown argument to justify libertarian rights against other non-libertarian rights theories—a point for which he has been widely criticized, most famously by Thomas Nagel (Nagel 1975). But what he does say in their defense suggests that he sees libertarian rights as an entailment of the other-regarding element in Kant's second formulation of the categorical imperative—that we treat the humanity in ourselves and others as an end in itself, and never merely as a means. According to Nozick, both utilitarianism and theories that uphold positive rights sanction the involuntary sacrifice of one individual's interests for the sake of others. Only libertarian rights, which for Nozick take the form of absolute side-constraints against force and fraud, show proper respect for the separateness of persons by barring such sacrifice altogether, and allowing each individual the liberty to pursue his or her own goals without interference.

Third, it is important to note that Nozick's libertarianism evaluates the justice of states of affairs, such as distributions of property, in terms of the history or process by which that state of affairs arose, and not by the extent to which it satisfies what he calls a patterned or end-state principle of justice. Distributions of property are just, according to Nozick, if they arose from previously just distributions by just procedures. Discerning the justice of current distributions thus requires that we establish a theory of justice in transfer—to tell us which procedures constitute legitimate means of transferring ownership between persons—and a theory of justice in acquisition—to tell us how individuals might come to own external goods that were previously owned by no one. And while Nozick does not fully develop either of these theories, his skeletal position is nevertheless significant, for it implies that it is only the proper historical pedigree that makes a distribution just, and it is only deviations from the proper pedigree that renders a distribution unjust. An implication of this position is that one cannot discern from time-slice statistical data alone—such as the claim that the top fifth of the income distribution in the United States controls more than 80 percent of the nation's wealth—that a distribution is unjust. Rather, the justice of a distribution depends on how it came about—by force or by trade? By differing degrees of hard work and luck? Or by fraud and theft? Libertarianism's historical focus thus sets the doctrine against both outcome-egalitarian views that hold that only equal distributions are just, utilitarian views that hold that distributions are just to the extent they maximize utility, and prioritarian views that hold that distributions are just to the extent they benefit the worse-off. Justice in distribution is a matter of respecting people's rights, not of achieving a certain outcome.

The final distinctive element of Nozick's view is his acceptance of a modified version of the Lockean proviso as part of his theory of justice in acquisition. Nozick reads Locke's claim that legitimate acts of appropriation must leave enough and as good for others as a claim that such appropriations must not worsen the situation of others (Nozick 1974, 175, 178). On the face of it, this seems like a small change from Locke's original statement, but Nozick believes it allows for much greater freedom for free exchange and capitalism (Nozick 1974, 182). Nozick reaches this conclusion on the basis of certain empirical beliefs about the beneficial effects of private property:

it increases the social product by putting means of production in the hands of those who can use them most efficiently (profitably); experimentation is encouraged, because with separate persons controlling resources, there is no one person or small group whom someone with a new idea must convince to try it out; private property enables people to decide on the pattern and type of risks they wish to bear, leading to specialized types of risk bearing; private property protects future persons by leading some to hold back resources from current consumption for future markets; it provides alternative sources of employment for unpopular persons who don't have to convince any one person or small group to hire them, and so on. (Nozick 1974, 177)

If these assumptions are correct, then persons might not be made worse off by acts of original appropriation even if those acts fail to leave enough and as good for others to appropriate. Private property and the capitalist markets to which it gives rise generate an abundance of wealth, and latecomers to the appropriation game (like people today) are in a much better position as a result. As David Schmidtz puts the point:

Original appropriation diminishes the stock of what can be originally appropriated, at least in the case of land, but that is not the same thing as diminishing the stock of what can be owned. On the contrary, in taking control of resources and thereby removing those particular resources from the stock of goods that can be acquired by original appropriation, people typically generate massive increases in the stock of goods that can be acquired by trade. The lesson is that appropriation is typically not a zero-sum game. It normally is a positive-sum game. (Schmidtz and Goodin 1998, 30)

Relative to their level of well-being in a world where nothing is privately held, then, individuals are generally not made worse off by acts of private appropriation. Thus, Nozick concludes, the Lockean proviso will "not provide a significant opportunity for future state action" in the form of redistribution or regulation of private property (Nozick 1974, 182).

c. Criticisms of Natural Rights Libertarianism

Nozick's libertarian theory has been subject to criticism on a number of grounds. Here we will focus on two primary categories of criticism of Lockean/Nozickian natural rights libertarianism—namely, with respect to the principle of self-ownership and the derivation of private property rights from self-ownership.

i. Principle of Self-Ownership

Criticisms of the self-ownership principle generally take one of two forms. Some arguments attempt to sever the connection between the principle of self-ownership and the more fundamental moral principles that are thought to justify it. Nozick's suggestion that self-ownership is warranted by the Kantian principle that no one should be treated as a mere means, for instance, is criticized by G.A. Cohen on the grounds that policies that violate self-ownership by forcing the well-off to support the less advantaged do not necessarily treat the well-off merely as means (Cohen 1995, 239–241). We can satisfy Kant's imperative against treating others as mere means without thereby committing ourselves to full self-ownership, Cohen argues, and we have good reason to do so insofar as the principle of self-ownership has other, implausible, consequences. The same general pattern of argument holds against more intuitive defenses of the self-ownership principle. Nozick's concern (Nozick 1977, 206), elaborated by Cohen (Cohen 1995, 70), that theories that deny self-ownership might license the forcible transfer of eyes from the sight-endowed to the blind, for instance, or Murray Rothbard's claim that the only alternatives to self-ownership are slavery or communism (Rothbard 1973, 29), have been met with the response that a denial of the permissibility of slavery, communism, and eye-transplants can be made—and usually better made—on grounds other than self-ownership.

Other criticisms of self-ownership focus on the counterintuitive or otherwise objectionable implications of self-ownership. Cohen, for instance, argues that recognizing rights to full self-ownership allows individuals' lives to be objectionably governed by brute luck in the distribution of natural assets, since the self that people own is largely a product of their luck in receiving a good or bad genetic endowment, and being raised in a good or bad environment (Cohen 1995, 229). Richard Arneson, on the other hand, has argued that self-ownership conflicts with Pareto-Optimality (Arneson 1991). His concern is that since self-ownership is construed by libertarians as an absolute right, it follows that it cannot be violated even in small ways and even when great benefit would accrue from doing so. Thus, to modify David Hume, absolute rights of self-ownership seem to prevent us from scratching the finger of another even to prevent the destruction of the whole world. And although the real objection here seems to be to the absoluteness of self-ownership rights, rather than to self-ownership rights as such, it remains unclear whether strict libertarianism can be preserved if rights of self-ownership are given a less than absolute status.

ii. Derivation of Full Private Property Ownership from Self-Ownership

Even if individuals have absolute rights to full self-ownership, it can still be questioned whether there is a legitimate way of moving from ownership of the self to ownership of external goods.

Left-libertarians, such as Hillel Steiner, Peter Vallentyne, and Michael Otsuka, grant the self-ownership principle but deny that it can yield full private property rights in external goods, especially land (Steiner 1994; Vallentyne 2000; Otsuka 2003). Natural resources, such theorists hold, belong to everyone in some equal way, and private appropriation of them amounts to theft. Rather than returning all such goods to the state of nature, however, most left-libertarians suggest that those who claim ownership of such resources be subjected to a tax to compensate others for the loss of their rights of use. Since the tax is on the value of the external resource and not on individuals' natural talents or efforts, it is thought that this line of argument can provide a justification for a kind of egalitarian redistribution that is compatible with full individual self-ownership.

While left-libertarians doubt that self-ownership can yield full private property rights in external goods, others are doubtful that the concept is determinate enough to yield any theory of justified property ownership at all. Locke's metaphor on labor mixing, for instance, is intuitively appealing, but notoriously difficult to work out in detail (Waldron 1983). First, it is not clear why mixing one's labor with something generates any rights at all. As Nozick himself asks, "why isn't mixing what I own with what I don't own a way of losing what I own rather than a way of gaining what I don't?" (Nozick 1974, 174–175). Second, it is not clear what the scope of the rights generated by labor-mixing are. Again, Nozick playfully suggests (but does not answer) this question when he asks whether a person who builds a fence around virgin land thereby comes to own the enclosed land, or simply the fence, or just the land immediately under it. But the point is more worrisome than Nozick acknowledges. For as critics such as Barbara Fried have pointed out, following Hohfeld, property ownership is not a single right but a bundle of rights, and it is far from clear which "sticks" from this bundle individuals should come to control by virtue of their self-ownership (Fried 2004). Does one's ownership right over a plot of land entail the right to store radioactive waste on it? To dam the river that runs through it? To shine a very bright light from it in the middle of the night (Friedman 1989, 168)? Problems such as these must, of course, be resolved by any political theory—not just libertarians. The problem is that the concept of self-ownership seems to offer little, if any, help in doing so.

3. Consequentialist Libertarianism

While Nozickian libertarianism finds its inspiration in Locke and Kant, there is another species of libertarianism that draws its influence from David Hume, Adam Smith, and John Stuart Mill. This variety of libertarianism holds its political principles to be grounded not in self-ownership or the natural rights of humanity, but in the beneficial consequences that libertarian rights and institutions produce, relative to possible and realistic alternatives. To the extent that such theorists hold that consequences, and only consequences, are relevant in the justification of libertarianism, they can properly be labeled a form of consequentialism. Some of these consequentialist forms of libertarianism are utilitarian. But consequentialism is not identical to utilitarianism, and this section will explore both traditional quantitative utilitarian defenses of libertarianism, and other forms more difficult to classify.

a. Quantitative Utilitarianism

Philosophically, the approach that seeks to justify political institutions by demonstrating their tendency to maximize utility has its clearest origins in the thought of Jeremy Bentham, himself a legal reformer as well as moral theorist. But, while Bentham was no advocate of unfettered laissez-faire, his approach has been enormously influential among economists, especially the Austrian and Chicago Schools of Economics, many of whom have utilized utilitarian analysis in support of libertarian political conclusions. Some influential economists have been self-consciously libertarian—the most notable of which being Ludwig von Mises, Friedrich Hayek, James Buchanan, and Milton Friedman (the latter three are Nobel laureates). Richard Epstein, more legal theorist than economist, nevertheless utilizes utilitarian argument with an economic analysis of law to defend his version of classical liberalism. His work in Principles for a Free Society (1998) and Skepticism and Freedom (2003) is probably the most philosophical of contemporary utilitarian defenses of libertarianism. Buchanan's work is generally described as contractarian, though it certainly draws heavily on utilitarian analysis. It too is highly philosophical.

Utilitarian defenses of libertarianism generally consist of two prongs: utilitarian arguments in support of private property and free exchange and utilitarian arguments against government policies that exceed the bounds of the minimal state. Utilitarian defenses of private property and free exchange are too diverse to thoroughly canvass in a single article. For the purposes of this article, however, the focus will be on two main arguments that have been especially influential: the so-called "Tragedy of the Commons" argument for private property and the "Invisible Hand" argument for free exchange.

i. The Tragedy of the Commons and Private Property

The Tragedy of the Commons argument notes that under certain conditions when property is commonly owned or, equivalently, owned by no one, it will be inefficiently used and quickly depleted. In his original description of the problem of the commons, Garrett Hardin asks us to imagine a pasture open to all, on which various herders graze their cattle (Hardin 1968). Each additional animal that the herder is able to graze means greater profit for the herder, who captures that entire benefit for his or her self. Of course, additional cattle on the pasture has a cost as well in terms of crowding and diminished carrying capacity of the land, but importantly this cost of additional grazing, unlike the benefit, is dispersed among all herders. Since each herder thus receives the full benefit of each additional animal but bears only a fraction of the dispersed cost, it benefits him or her to graze more and more animals on the land. But since this same logic applies equally well to all herders, we can expect them all to act this way, with the result that the carrying capacity of the field will quickly be exceeded.

The tragedy of the Tragedy of the Commons is especially apparent if we model it as a Prisoner's Dilemma, wherein each party has the option to graze additional animals or not to graze. (See figure 1, below, where A and B represent two herders, "graze" and "don't graze" their possible options, and the four possible outcomes of their joint action. Within the boxes, the numbers represent the utility each herder receives from the outcome, with A's outcome listed on the left and B's on the right). As the discussion above suggests, the best outcome for each individual herder is to graze an additional animal, but for the other herder not to—here the herder reaps all the benefit and only a fraction of the cost. The worst outcome for each individual herder, conversely, is to refrain from grazing an additional animal while the other herder indulges—in this situation, the herder bears costs but receives no benefit. The relationship between the other two possible outcomes is important. Both herders would be better off if neither grazed an additional animal, compared to the outcome in which both do graze an additional animal. The long-term benefits of operating within the carrying capacity of the land, we can assume, outweigh the short-term gains to be had from mutual overgrazing. By the logic of the Prisoner's Dilemma, however, rational self-interested herders will not choose mutual restraint over mutual exploitation of the resource. This is because, so long as the costs of over-grazing are partially externalized on to other users of the resource, it is in each herder's interest to overgraze regardless of what the other party does. In the language of game theory, overgrazing dominates restraint. As a result, not only is the resource consumed, but both parties are made worse off individually than they could have been. Mutual overgrazing creates a situation that not only yields a lower total utility than mutual restraint (2 vs. 6), but that is Pareto-inferior to mutual restraint—at least one party (indeed, both!) would have been made better off by mutual restraint without anyone having been made worse off.

Don't Graze
Don't Graze
3, 3
0, 5
5, 0
1, 1

Figure 1. The Tragedy of the Commons as Prisoner's Dilemma

The classic solution to the Tragedy of the Commons is private property. Recall that the tragedy arises because individual herders do not have to bear the full costs of their actions. Because the land is common to all, the costs of overgrazing are partially externalized on to other users of the resource. But private property changes this. If, instead of being commonly owned by all, the field was instead divided into smaller pieces of private property, then herders would have the power to exclude others from using their own property. One would only be able to graze cattle on one's own field, or on others' fields on terms specified by their owners, and this means that the costs of that overgrazing (in terms of diminished usability of the land or diminished resale value because of that diminished usability) would be borne by the overgrazer alone. Private property forces individuals to internalize the cost of their actions, and this in turn provides individuals with an incentive to use the resource wisely.

The lesson is that by creating and respecting private property rights in external resources, governments can provide individuals with an incentive to use those resources in an efficient way, without the need for complicated government regulation and oversight of those resources. Libertarians have used this basic insight to argue for everything from privatization of roads (Klein and Fielding 1992) to private property as a solution to various environmental problems (Anderson and Leal 1991).

ii. The Invisible Hand and Free Exchange

Libertarians believe that individuals and groups should be free to trade just about anything they wish with whomever they wish, with little to no governmental restriction. They therefore oppose laws that prohibit certain types of exchanges (such as prohibitions on prostitution and sale of illegal drugs, minimum wage laws that effectively prohibit low-wage labor agreements, and so on) as well as laws that burden exchanges by imposing high transaction costs (such as import tariffs).

The reason utilitarian libertarians support free exchange is that, they argue, it tends to allocate resources into the hands of those who value them most, and in so doing to increase the total amount of utility in society. The first step in seeing this is to understand that even if trade is a zero-sum game in terms of the objects that are traded (nothing is created or destroyed, just moved about), it is a positive-sum game in terms of utility. This is because individuals differ in terms of the subjective utility they assign to goods. A person planning to move from Chicago to San Diego might assign a relatively low utility value to her large, heavy furniture. It's difficult and costly to move, and might not match the style of the new home anyway. But to someone else who has just moved into an empty apartment in Chicago, that furniture might have a very high utility value indeed. If the first person values the furniture at $200 (or its equivalent in terms of utility) and the second person values it at $500, both will gain if they exchange for a price anywhere between those two values. Each will have given up something they value less in exchange for something they value more, and net utility will have increased as a result.

As Friedrich Hayek has noted, much of the information about the relative utility values assigned to different goods is transmitted to different actors in the market via the price system (Hayek 1980). An increase in a resource's price signals that demand for that resource has increased relative to supply. Consumers can respond to this price increase by continuing to use the resource at the now-higher price, switching to a substitute good, or discontinuing use of that sort of resource altogether. Each individual's decision is both affected by the price of the relevant resources, and affects the price insofar as it adds to or subtracts from aggregate supply and demand. Thus, though they generally do not know it, each person's decision is a response to the decisions of millions of other consumers and producers of the resource, each of whom bases her decision on her own specialized, local knowledge about that resource. And although all they are trying to do is maximize their own utility, each individual will be led to act in a way that leads the resource toward its highest-valued use. Those who derive the most utility from the good will outbid others for its use, and others will be led to look for cheaper substitutes.

On this account, one deeply influenced by the Austrian School of Economics, the market is a constantly churning process of competition, discovery, and innovation. Market prices represent aggregates of information and so generally represent an advance over what any one individual could hope to know on his own, but the individual decisions out of which market prices arise are themselves based on imperfect information. There are always opportunities that nobody has discovered, and the passage of time, the changing of people's preferences, and the development of new technological possibilities ensures that this ignorance will never be fully overcome. The market is thus never in a state of competitive equilibrium, and it will always "fail" by the test of perfect efficiency. But it is precisely today's market failures that provide the opportunities for tomorrow's entrepreneurs to profit by new innovation (Kirzner 1996). Competition is a process, not a goal to be reached, and it is a process driven by the particular decisions of individuals who are mostly unaware of the overall and long-term tendencies of their decisions taken as a whole. Even if no market actor cares about increasing the aggregate level of utility in society, he will be, as Adam Smith wrote, "led by an invisible hand to promote an end which was no part of his intention" (Smith 1981). The dispersed knowledge of millions of market actors will be taken into account in producing a distribution that comes as close as practically possible to that which would be selected by a benign, omniscient, and omnipotent despot. In reality, however, all that government is required to do in order to achieve this effect is to define and enforce clear property rights and to allow the price system to freely adjust in response to changing conditions.

iii. Arguments Against Government Intervention

The above two arguments, if successful, demonstrate that free markets and private property generate good utilitarian outcomes. But even if this is true, it remains possible that selective government intervention in the economy could produce outcomes that are even better. Governments might use taxation and coercion for the provision of public goods, or to prevent other sorts of market failures like monopolies. Or governments might engage in redistributive taxation on the grounds that given the diminishing marginal utility of wealth, doing so will provide higher levels of overall utility. In order to maintain their opposition to government intervention, then, libertarians must produce arguments to show that such policies will not produce greater utility than a policy of laissez-faire. Producing such arguments is something of a cottage industry among libertarian economists, and so we cannot hope to provide a complete summary here. Two main categories of argument, however, have been especially influential. We can call them incentive-based arguments and public choice arguments.

Incentive arguments proceed by claiming that government policies designed to promote utility actually produce incentives for individuals to act in ways that run contrary to promotion of utility. Examples of incentive arguments include arguments that (a) government-provided (welfare) benefits dissuade individuals from taking responsibility for their own economic well-being (Murray 1984), (b) mandatory minimum wage laws generate unemployment among low-skilled workers (Friedman 1962, 180–181), (c) legal prohibition of drugs create a black market with inflated prices, low quality control, and violence (Thornton 1991), and (d) higher taxes lead people to work and/or invest less, and hence lead to lower economic growth.

Public choice arguments, on the other hand, are often employed by libertarians to undermine the assumption that government will use its powers to promote the public interest in the way its proponents claim it will. Public choice as a field is based on the assumption that the model of rational self-interest typically employed by economists to predict the behavior of market agents can also be used to predict the behavior of government agents. Rather than trying to maximize profit, however, government agents are thought to be aiming at re-election (in the case of elected officials) or maintenance or expansion of budget and influence (in the case of bureaucrats). From this basic analytical model, public choice theorists have argued that (a) the fact that the costs of many policies are widely dispersed among taxpayers, while their benefits are often concentrated in the hands of a few beneficiaries, means that even grossly inefficient policies will be enacted and, once enacted, very difficult to remove, (b) politicians and bureaucrats will engage in "rent-seeking" behavior by exploiting the powers of their office for personal gain rather than public good, and (c) certain public goods will be over-supplied by political processes, while others will be under-supplied, since government agents lack both knowledge and incentives necessary to provide such goods at efficient levels (Mitchell and Simmons 1994). These problems are held to be endemic to political processes, and not easily subject to legislative or constitutional correction. Hence, many conclude that the only way to minimize the problems of political power is to minimize the scope of political power itself by subjecting as few areas of life as possible to political regulation.

b. Traditionalist Consequentialism

The quantitative utilitarians are often both rationalist and radical in their approach to social reform. For them, the maximization of utility serves as an axiomatic first principle, from which policy conclusions can be straightforwardly deduced once empirical (or quasi-empirical) assessments of causal relationships in the world have been made. From Jeremy Bentham to Peter Singer, quantitative utilitarians have advocated dramatic changes in social institutions, all justified in the name of reason and the morality it gives rise to.

There is, however, another strain of consequentialism that is less confident in the ability of human reason to radically reform social institutions for the better. For these consequentialists, social institutions are the product of an evolutionary process that itself is the product of the decisions of millions of discrete individuals. Each of these individuals in turn possess knowledge that, though by itself is insignificant, in the aggregate represents more than any single social reformer could ever hope to match. Humility, not radicalism, is counseled by this variety of consequentialism.

Though it has its affinities with conservative doctrines such as those of Edmund Burke, Michael Oakeshott, and Russell Kirk, this strain of consequentialism had its greatest influence on libertarianism through the work of Friedrich Hayek. Hayek, however, takes pains to distance himself from conservative ideology, noting that his respect for tradition is not grounded in a fetish for the status quo or an opposition to change as such, but in deeper, distinctively liberal principles (Hayek 1960). For Hayek, tradition is valuable because, and only to the extent that, it evolves in a peaceful, decentralized way. Social norms that are chosen by free individuals and survive competition from competing norms without being maintained by coercion are, for that reason, worthy of respect even if we are not consciously aware of all the reasons that the institution has survived. Somewhat paradoxically then, Hayek believes that we can rationally support institutions even when we lack substantive justifying reasons for supporting them. The reason this can be rational is that even when we lack substantive justifying reasons, we nevertheless have justifying reasons in a procedural sense—the fact that the institution is the result of an evolutionary procedure of a certain sort gives us reason to believe that there are substantive justifying reasons for it, even if we do not know what they are (Gaus 2006).

For Hayek, the procedures that lend justifying force to institutions are, essentially, ones that leave individuals free to act as they wish so long as they do not act aggressively toward others. For Hayek, however, this principle is not a moral axiom but rather follows from his beliefs regarding the limits and uses of knowledge in society. A crucial piece of Hayek's arguments regarding the price system, (see above) is his claim that each individual possesses a unique set of knowledge about his or her local circumstances, special interests, desires, abilities, and so forth. The price system, if allowed to function freely without artificial floors or ceilings, will reflect this knowledge and transmit it to other interested individuals, thus allowing society to make effective use of dispersed knowledge. But Hayek's defense of the price system is only one application of a more general point. The fact that knowledge of all sorts exists in dispersed form among many individuals is a fundamental fact about human existence. And since this knowledge is constantly changing in response to changing circumstances and cannot therefore be collected and acted upon by any central authority, the only way to make use of this knowledge effectively is to allow individuals the freedom to act on it themselves. This means that government must disallow individuals from coercing one another, and also must refrain from coercing them themselves. The social order that such voluntary actions produce is one that, given the complexity of social and economic systems and radical limitations on our ability to acquire knowledge about its particular details (Gaus 2007), cannot be imposed by fiat, but must evolve spontaneously in a bottom-up manner. Hayek, like Mill before him (Mill 1989), thus celebrates the fact that a free society allows individuals to engage in "experiments in living" and therefore, as Nozick argued in the neglected third part of his Anarchy, State, and Utopia, can serve as a "utopia of utopias" where individuals are at liberty to organize their own conception of the good life with others who voluntarily choose to share their vision (Hayek 1960).

Hayek's ideas about the relationship between knowledge, freedom, and a constitutional order were first developed at length in The Constitution of Liberty, later developed in his series Law, Legislation and Liberty, and given their last, and most accessible (though not necessarily most reliable (Caldwell 2005)) statement in The Fatal Conceit: The Errors of Socialism (1988). Since then, the most extensive integration of these ideas into a libertarian framework is in Randy Barnett's The Structure of Liberty, wherein Barnett argues that a "polycentric constitutional order" (see below regarding anarcho-capitalism) is best suited to solve not only the Hayekian problem of the use of knowledge in society, but also what he calls the problems of "interest" and "power" (Barnett 1998). More recently, Hayekian insights have been put to use by contemporary philosophers Chandran Kukathas (1989; 2006) and Gerald Gaus (2006; 2007).

c. Criticisms of Consequentialist Libertarianism

Consequentialist defenses of libertarianism are, of course, varieties of consequentialist moral argument, and are susceptible therefore to the same kinds of criticisms leveled against consequentialist moral arguments in general. Beyond these standard criticisms, moreover, consequentialist defenses of libertarianism are subject to four special difficulties.

First, consequentialist arguments seem unlikely to lead one to full-fledged libertarianism, as opposed to more moderate forms of classical liberalism. Intuitively, it seems implausible that simple protection of individual negative liberties would do a better job than any alternative institutional arrangement at maximizing utility or peace and prosperity or whatever. And this intuitive doubt is buttressed by economic analyses showing that unregulated capitalist markets suffer from production of negative externalities, from monopoly power, and from undersupply of certain public goods, all of which cry out for some form of government protection (Buchanan 1985). Even granting libertarian claims that (a) these problems are vastly overstated, (b) often caused by previous failures of government to adequately respect or enforce private property rights, and (c) government ability to correct these is not as great as one might think, it's nevertheless implausible to suppose, a priori, that it will never be the case that government can do a better job than the market by interfering with strict libertarian rights.

Second, consequentialist defenses of libertarianism are subject to objections when a great deal of benefit can be had at a very low cost. So-called cases of "easy rescue," for instance, challenge the wisdom of adhering to absolute prohibitions on coercive conduct. After all, if the majority of the world's population lives in dire poverty and suffer from easily preventable diseases and deaths, couldn't utility be increased by increasing taxes slightly on wealthy Americans and using that surplus to provide basic medical aid to those in desperate need? The prevalence of such cases is an empirical question, but their possibility points (at least) to a "fragility" in the consequentialist case for libertarian prohibitions on redistributive taxation.

Third, the consequentialist theories at the root of these libertarian arguments are often seriously under-theorized. For instance, Randy Barnett bases his defense of libertarian natural rights on the claim that they promote the end of "happiness, peace and prosperity" (Barnett 1998). But this leaves a host of difficult questions unaddressed. The meaning of each of these terms, for instance, has been subject to intense philosophical debate. Which sense of happiness, then, does libertarianism promote? What happens when these ends conflict—when we have to choose, say, between peace and prosperity? And in what sense do libertarian rights "promote" these ends? Are they supposed to maximize happiness in the aggregate? Or to maximize each person's happiness? Or to maximize the weighted sum of happiness, peace, and prosperity? Richard Epstein is on more familiar and hence, perhaps, firmer ground when he says that his version of classical liberalism is meant to maximize utility, but even here the claim that utility maximization is the proper end of political action is asserted without argument. The lesson is that while consequentialist political arguments might seem less abstract and philosophical (in the pejorative sense) than deontological arguments, consequentialism is still, nevertheless, a moral theory, and needs to be clearly articulated and defended as any other moral theory. Possibly because consequentialist defenses of libertarianism have been put forward mainly by non-philosophers, this challenge has yet to be met.

A fourth and related point has to do with issues surrounding the distribution of wealth, happiness, opportunities, and other goods allegedly promoted by libertarian rights. In part, this is a worry common to all maximizing versions of consequentialism, but it is of special relevance in this context given the close relation between economic systems and distributional issues. The worry is that morality, or justice, requires more than simply producing an abundance of wealth, happiness, or whatever. It requires that each person gets a fair share—whether that is defined as an equal share, a share sufficient for living a good life, or something else. Intuitively fair distributions are simply not something that libertarian institutions can guarantee, devoid as they are of any means for redistributing these goods from the well-off to the less well-off. Furthermore, once it is granted that libertarianism is likely to produce unequal distributions of wealth, the Hayekian argument for relying on the free price system to allocate goods no longer holds as strongly as it appeared to. For we cannot simply assume that a free price system will lead to goods being allocated to their most valued use if some people have an abundance of wealth and others very little at all. A free market of self-interested persons will not distribute bread to the starving man, no matter how much utility he would derive from it, if he cannot pay for it. And a wealthy person, such as Bill Gates, will still always be able to outbid a poor person for season tickets to the Mariners, even if the poor person values the tickets much more highly than he, since the marginal value of the dollars he spends on the tickets is much lower to him than the marginal value of the poor person's dollars. Both by an external standard of fairness and by an internal standard of utility-maximization, then, unregulated free markets seem to fall short.

4. Anarcho-Capitalism

Anarcho-capitalists claim that no state is morally justified (hence their anarchism), and that the traditional functions of the state ought to be provided by voluntary production and trade instead (hence their capitalism). This position poses a serious challenge to both moderate classical liberals and more radical minimal state libertarians, though, as we shall see, the stability of the latter position is especially threatened by the anarchist challenge.

Anarcho-capitalism can be defended on either consequentialist or deontological grounds, though usually a mix of both arguments is proffered. On the consequentialist side, it is argued that police protection, court systems, and even law itself can be provided voluntarily for a price like any other market good (Friedman 1989; Rothbard 1978; Barnett 1998; Hasnas 2003; Hasnas 2007). And not only is it possible for markets to provide these traditionally state-supplied goods, it is actually more desirable for them to do so given that competitive pressures in this market, as in others, will produce an array of goods that is of higher general quality and that is diverse enough to satisfy individuals' differing preferences (Friedman 1989; Barnett 1998). Deontologically, anarcho-capitalists argue that the minimal state necessarily violates individual rights insofar as it (1) claims a monopoly on the legitimate use of force and thereby prohibits other individuals from exercising force in accordance with their natural rights, and (2) funds its protective services with coercively obtained tax revenue that it sometimes (3) uses redistributively to pay for protection for those who are unable to pay for themselves (Rothbard 1978; Childs 1994).

Robert Nozick was one of the first academic philosophers to take the anarchist challenge seriously. In the first part of his Anarchy, State, and Utopia he argued that the minimal state can evolve out of an anarcho-capitalist society through an invisible hand process that does not violate anyone's rights. Competitive pressures and violent conflict, he argued, will provide incentives for competing defensive agencies to merge or collude so that, effectively, monopolies will emerge over certain geographical areas (Nozick 1974). Since these monopolies are merely de facto, however, the dominant protection agency does not yet constitute a state. For that to occur, the "dominant protection agency" must claim that it would be morally illegitimate for other protection agencies to operate, and make some reasonably effective attempt to prohibit them from doing so. Nozick's argument that it would be legitimate for the dominant protection agency to do so is one of the most controversial aspects of his argument. Essentially, he argues that individuals have rights not to be subject to the risk of rights-violation, and that the dominant protection agency may legitimately prohibit the protective activities of its competitors on grounds that their procedures involve the imposition of risk. In claiming and enforcing this monopoly, the dominant protection agency becomes what Nozick calls the "ultraminimal state"—ultraminimal because it does not provide protective services for all persons within its geographical territory, but only those who pay for them. The transition from the ultraminimal state to the minimal one occurs when the dominant protection agency (now state) provides protective services to all individuals within its territory, and Nozick argues that the state is morally obligated to do this in order to provide compensation to the individuals who have been disadvantaged by its seizure of monopoly power.

Nozick's arguments against the anarchist have been challenged on a number of grounds. First, the justification for the state it provides is entirely hypothetical—the most he attempts to claim is that a state could arise legitimately from the state of nature, not that any actual state has (Rothbard 1977). But if hypotheticals were all that mattered, then an equally compelling story could be told of how the minimal state could devolve back into merely one competitive agency among others by a process that violates no one's rights (Childs 1977), thus leaving us at a justificatory stalemate. Second, it is questionable whether prohibiting activities that run the risk of violating rights, but do not actually violate any, is compatible with fundamental liberal principles (Rothbard 1977). Finally, even if the general principle of prohibition with compensation is legitimate, it is nevertheless doubtful that the proper way to compensate the anarchist who has been harmed by the state's claim of monopoly is to provide him with precisely what he does not want—state police and military services (Childs 1977).

Until decisively rebutted, then, the anarchist position remains a serious challenge for libertarians, especially of the minimal state variety. This is true regardless of whether their libertarianism is defended on consequentialist or natural rights grounds. For the consequentialist libertarian, the challenge is to explain why law and protective services are the only goods that require state provision in order to maximize utility (or whatever the maximandum may be). If, for instance, the consequentialist justification for the state provision of law is that law is a public good, then the question is: Why should other public goods not also be provided? The claim that only police, courts, and military fit the bill appears to be more an a priori article of faith than a consequence of empirical analysis. This consideration might explain why so many consequentialist libertarians are in fact classical liberals who are willing to grant legitimacy to a larger than minimal state (Friedman 1962; Hayek 1960; Epstein 2003). For deontological libertarians, on the other hand, the challenge is to show why the state is justified in (a) prohibiting individuals from exercising or purchasing protective activities on their own and (b) financing protective services through coercive and redistributive taxation. If this sort of prohibition, and this sort of coercion and redistribution is justified, why not others? Once the bright line of non-aggression has been crossed, it is difficult to find a compelling substitute.

This is not to say that anarcho-capitalists do not face challenges of their own. First, many have pointed out that there is a paucity of empirical evidence to support the claim that anarcho-capitalism could function in a modern post-industrial society. Pointing to quasi-examples from Medieval Iceland (Friedman 1979) does little to alleviate this concern (Epstein 2003). Second, even if a plausible case could be made for the market provision of law and private defense, the market provision of national defense, which fits the characteristics of a public good almost perfectly, remains a far more difficult challenge (Friedman 1989). Finally, when it comes to rights and anarchy, one philosopher's modus ponens is another's modus tollens. If respect for robust rights of self-ownership and property in external goods, as libertarians understand them, entail anarcho-capitalism, why not then reject these rights rather than embrace anarcho-capitalism? Rothbard, Nozick and other natural rights libertarians are notoriously lacking in foundational arguments to support their strong belief in these rights. In the absence of strong countervailing reasons to accept these rights and the libertarian interpretation of them, the fact that they lead to what might seem to be absurd conclusions could be a decisive reason to reject them.

5. Other Approaches to Libertarianism

This entry has focused on the main approaches to libertarianism popular among academic philosophers. But it has not been exhaustive. There are other philosophical defenses of libertarianism that space prevents exploring in detail, but deserve mention nevertheless. These include defenses of libertarianism that proceed from teleological and contractual considerations.

a. Teleological Libertarianism

One increasingly influential approach takes as its normative foundation a virtue-centered ethical theory. Such theories hold that libertarian political institutions are justified in the way they allow individuals to develop as virtuous agents. Ayn Rand was perhaps the earliest modern proponent of such theory, and while her writings were largely ignored by academics, the core idea has since been picked up and developed with greater sophistication by philosophers like Tara Smith, Douglas Rasmussen, and Douglas Den Uyl (Rasmussen and Den Uyl 1991; 2005).

Teleological versions of libertarianism are in some significant respects similar to consequentialist versions, insofar as they hold that political institutions are to be judged in light of their tendency to yield a certain sort of outcome. But the consequentialism at work here is markedly different from the aggregative and impartial consequentialism of act-utilitarianism. Political institutions are to be judged based on the extent to which they allow individuals to flourish, but flourishing is a value that is agent-relative (and not agent-neutral as is happiness for the utilitarian), and also one that can only be achieved by the self-directed activity of each individual agent (and not something that can be distributed among individuals by the state). It is thus not the job of political institutions to promote flourishing by means of activist policies, but merely to make room for it by enforcing the core set of libertarian rights.

These claims lead to challenges for the teleological libertarian, however. If human flourishing is good, it must be so in an agent-neutral or in an agent-relative sense. If it is good in an agent-neutral sense, then it is unclear why we do not share positive duties to promote the flourishing of others, alongside merely negative duties to refrain from hindering their pursuit of their own flourishing.

Teleological libertarians generally argue that flourishing is something that cannot be provided for one by others since it is essentially a matter of exercising one's own practical reason in the pursuit of a good life. But surely others can provide for us some of the means for our exercise of practical reason—from basics such as food and shelter to more complex goods such as education and perhaps even the social bases of self-respect. If, on the other hand, human flourishing is a good in merely an agent-relative sense, then it is unclear why others' flourishing imposes any duties on us at all—positive or negative. If duties to respect the negative rights of others are not grounded in the agent-neutral value of others' flourishing, then presumably they must be grounded in our own flourishing, but (a) making the wrongness of harming others depend on its negative effect on us seems to make that wrongness too contingent on situational facts—surely there are some cases in which violating the rights of others can benefit us, even in the long-term holistic sense required by eudaimonistic accounts. And (b) the fact that wronging others will hurt us seems to be the wrong kind of explanation for why rights-violating acts are wrong. It seems to get matters backwards: rights-violating actions are wrong because of their effects on the person whose rights are violated, not because they detract from the rights-violator's virtue.

b. Contractarian Libertarianism

Another moral framework that has become increasingly popular among philosophers since Rawls's Theory of Justice (1971) is contractarianism. As a moral theory, contractarianism is the idea that moral principles are justified if and only if they are the product of a certain kind of agreement among persons. Among libertarians, this idea has been developed by Jan Narveson in his book, The Libertarian Idea (1988), which attempts to show that rational individuals would agree to a government that took individual negative liberty as the only relevant consideration in setting policy. And, while not self-described as a contractarian, Loren Lomasky's work in Persons, Rights, and the Moral Community (1987) has many affinities with this approach, as it attempts to defend libertarianism as a kind of policy of mutual-advantage between persons.

c. Conclusion: Libertarianism as an Overlapping Consensus

Most of the libertarian theories we have surveyed in this article have a common structure: foundational philosophical commitments are set out, theories are built upon them, and practical conclusions are derived from those theories. This approach has the advantage of thoroughness—one's ultimate political conclusions are undergirded by a weighty philosophical system to which any challengers can be directed. The downside of this approach is that anyone who disagrees with one's philosophic foundations will not be much persuaded by one's conclusions drawn from them—and philosophers are not generally known for their widespread agreement on foundational issues.

As a result, much of the most interesting work in contemporary libertarian theory skips systematic theory-building altogether, and heads straight to the analysis of concrete problems. Often this analysis proceeds by accepting some set of values as given—often the values embraced by those who are not sympathetic to libertarianism as a political theory—and showing that libertarian political institutions will better realize those values than competing institutional frameworks. Daniel Shapiro's recent work on welfare states (Shapiro 2007), for instance, is a good example of this trend, in arguing that contemporary welfare states are unjustifiable from a variety of popular theoretical approaches. Loren Lomasky (2005) has written a humorous but important piece arguing that Rawls's foundational principles are better suited to defending Nozickian libertarianism than even Nozick's foundational principles are. And David Schmidtz (Schmidtz and Goodin 1998) has argued that market institutions are supported on grounds of individual responsibility that any moral framework ought to take seriously. While such approaches lack the theoretical completeness that philosophers naturally crave, they nevertheless have the virtue of addressing crucially important social issues in a way that dispenses with the need for complete agreement on comprehensive moral theories.

A theoretical justification of this approach can be found in John Rawls's notion of an overlapping consensus, as developed in his work Political Liberalism (1993). Rawls's idea is that decisions about which political institutions and principles to adopt ought to be based on those aspects of morality on which all reasonable theories converge, rather than any one particular foundational moral theory, because there is reasonable and apparently intractable disagreement about foundational moral issues. Extending this overlapping consensus approach to libertarianism, then, entails viewing libertarianism as a political theory that is compatible with a variety of foundational metaphysical, epistemological, and ethical views. Individuals need not settle their reasonable disagreements regarding moral issues in order to agree upon a framework for political association; and libertarianism, with its robust toleration of individual differences, seems well-suited to serve as the principle for such a framework (Barnett 2004).

6. References and Further Reading

  • Anderson, T. L. and Leal, D. R. Free-market Environmentalism. San Francisco: Pacific Research Institute, 1991.
    • Argues that free markets can do a better job than government regulation and management at protecting and promoting environmental goods, with detailed application to water markets, oceans, forests, and more.
  • Arneson, R. "Lockean Self-Ownership: Toward a Demolition." Political Studies, 39 (March), 36–54, 1991.
    • A criticism of the concept of self-ownership from a contemporary liberal egalitarian philosopher. Argues that the principle is both less determinate than has been typically supposed, and that even where it has determinate implications it is unacceptable on moral grounds.
  • Barnett, R. E. The Structure of Liberty: Justice and the Rule of Law. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998.
    • A contemporary work of libertarian theory that weaves Hayekian insights regarding prices and information, public choice insights regarding governmental inefficiencies, and restitution-based insights on punishment arguing for a "polycentric constitutional order" (anarcho-capitalism).
  • Barnett, R. E. "The Moral Foundations of Modern Libertarianism," in Peter Berkowitz (ed.), Varieties of Conservatism in America. Stanford: Hoover Institution Press, 2004.
    • Argues that libertarians need not choose between consequentialist and deontological foundations for their position, but can advocate it based on the idea that libertarianism's
      support for the rule of law serves as the basis for an "overlapping consensus" of reasonable moral views.
  • Barry, N. P. On Classical Liberalism and Libertarianism. London: Macmillan, 1986.
    • A thorough and largely sympathetic survey of the major varieties of classical liberal and libertarian political thought, together with their philosophic foundations and weaknesses.
  • Berlin, I. "Two Concepts of Liberty," in Isaiah Berlin, Four Essays on Liberty. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1990 [1958].
    • A classic defense of the political pursuit of negative over positive liberty. See, however, Rothbard's essay "Isaiah Berlin on Negative Freedom" in The Ethics of Liberty (1982) for a libertarian criticism of this distinction and Berlin's argument for it.
  • Buchanan, A. Ethics, Efficiency and the Market. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1985.
    • Critical survey of consequentialist, natural rights, and other deontological arguments for free markets by a first-rate philosopher.
  • Buchanan, J. and Tullock, G. The Calculus of Consent. Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press, 1962.
    • The founding text of the public choice school of political economics, which applies the assumption of rational self-interest to government agents to predict their behavior and assist in institutional design.
  • Caldwell, B. Hayek's Challenge: An Intellectual Biography of F.A. Hayek. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2005.
    • An excellent source for biographical details of Hayek's life, as well as a concise summary of his economic, political, social, and scientific thought, and discussion of its influence.
  • Childs, R. A. "The Invisible Hand Strikes Back." Journal of Libertarian Studies, 1 (1), 23–33, 1977.
    • An attempt to refute Nozick's argument that society can progress from anarchy to a minimal state by an "invisible hand" process that violates no one's rights.
  • Childs, R. A. "Objectivism and the State: An Open Letter to Ayn Rand," in J. K. Taylor (ed.), Liberty Against Power: Essays by Roy A. Childs, Jr. San Francisco: Fox and Wilkes, 1994 [1969].
    • Argues that Ayn Rand's defense of a minimal state is incompatible with her more basic views regarding men's natural rights against the initiation of force, and that a proper respect for those rights requires anarcho-capitalism.
  • Cohen, G. A. Self-ownership, Freedom, and Equality. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • A critical exploration of Nozick's reliance on the concept of "self-ownership." Cohen argues that Nozick's libertarian conclusions do not necessarily follow from self-ownership, and that we have good reason to reject the concept anyway.
  • Epstein, R. A. Simple Rules for a Complex World. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1995.
    • An argument for a classical liberal order centered on the virtues of the simple legal rules such an order would employ. Epstein provides both a theoretical argument for the virtues of simplicity, and applications of the argument to a wide array of legal controversies.
  • Epstein, R. A. Principles for a Free Society: Reconciling Individual Liberty with the Common Good. New York: Basic Books, 1998.
    • Epstein's most philosophical contribution to classical liberal theory, an argument based on a utilitarian justification of natural law reasoning, and a reinterpretation of Mill's Harm Principle.
  • Epstein, R. A. Skepticism and Freedom: A Modern Case for Classical Liberalism. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2003.
    • A defense of classical liberalism from challenges of moral relativism, skepticism over legal rules, skepticism over core concepts of classical liberalism, and behavioral economics.
  • Fried, B. "Left-Libertarianissm: A Review Essay." Philosophy and Public Affairs, 32 (1), 66–92, 2004.
    • Ostensibly a critique of the coherence and alleged "libertarianism" of contemporary left-libertarian theories. Fried's criticisms, however, apply to many natural-rights approaches to right-libertarianism as well. See also the response piece by Vallentyne, Steiner, and Otsuka in vol. 33, no. 2, of the same journal.
  • Friedman, D. "Private Creation and Enforcement of Law: A Historical Case." Journal of Legal Studies, 8 (2), 399–415, 1979.
    • Puts forth Medieval Iceland as a case study of a well-functioning anarchic social order.
  • Friedman, D. The Machinery of Freedom: Guide to Radical Capitalism, 2nd ed. La Salle: Open Court, 1989.
    • A utilitarian defense of anarcho-capitalism. The second condition also contains a valuable postscript that discusses problems for non-utilitarian defenses of libertarianism.
  • Friedman, M. Capitalism and Freedom. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1962.
    • Argues that economic freedom and political freedom are intimately connected, and presents the case for free markets and voluntary action in education, poverty relief, occupational licensure, and more. A classic.
  • Gaus, G. "Hayek on the Evolution of Society and Mind," in E. Feser (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Hayek. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006.
    • A systematic exploration of the concept of "evolution" as employed in Hayek's social and economic thought, and in his philosophy of mind. Defends Hayek's use of the concept against criticisms that it is normatively vacuous or that it fails to justify a market order.
  • Gaus, G. "Social Complexity and Evolved Moral Principles," in P. McNamara (ed.), Liberalism, Conservatism, and Hayek's Idea of Spontaneous Order. London: Palgrave Macmillan, 2007.
    • An exploration and defense of the Hayekian idea that because of the complexity of social orders, governments should adhere to abstract moral principles rather than violating those principles and seeking to promote expedient outcomes.
  • Hardin, G. "The Tragedy of the Commons." Science,162, 1243–1248, 1968.
    • The classic statement of the tragedy of the commons. Hardin, however, draws the distinctively un-libertarian conclusion that because the carrying capacity of the earth as a whole is a commons, freedom to reproduce must be severely coercively curtailed if overpopulation and its attendant problems are to be avoided.
  • Hasnas, J. "Reflections on the Minimal State." Politics, Philosophy and Economics, 2 (1), 115–128, 2003.
    • Argues that public-good arguments for the state provision of law and law enforcement fail, since the state can ensure such goods are provided without providing them itself. Hence, even if they were valid, public good arguments would not justify the "minimal state," but something smaller.
  • Hasnas, J. "The Obviousness of Anarchy," in R. Long and T. Machan (eds.), Anarchism/Minarchism: Is Government Part of a Free Country? United Kingdom: Ashgate Press, 2007.
    • Argues that anarchism's feasibility can be demonstrated by surveying a number of contemporary and historical examples where the goods that government is thought to be necessary to provide have been or are provided by voluntary means.
  • Hayek, F. A. The Constitution of Liberty. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1960.
    • The early statement of Hayek's social theory, later developed in more detail in his Law, Legislation, and Liberty series. This book presents Hayek's theory of freedom, coercion, and law, presents a defense of a classical liberal social order, and discusses the problems involved in modern welfare states.
  • Hayek, F. A. Law, Legislation and Liberty. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1973.
    • This three volume series represents the fullest development of Hayek's social and political thought, applying his concepts of dispersed knowledge and spontaneous order to the phenomena of law and justice.
  • Hayek, F. A. "The Use of Knowledge in Society," in F. Hayek (ed.), Individualism and Economic Order. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1980 [1945].
    • Hayek's seminal paper discussing the way in which a free price system serves to convey information and coordinate social action.
  • Hayek, F. A. and Bartley III, W. W. The Fatal Conceit: The Errors of Socialism. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1988.
    • Presents Hayek's theory of the origins and evolution of modern society, his defense of a form of liberal traditionalism, and his critique of political rationalism, especially as it manifests itself in socialism.
  • Kirzner, I. The Meaning of Market Process. New York: Routledge, 1996.
    • A collection of essays by one of the world's leading Austrian economists. This book focuses on the role of ignorance, uncertainty, and time in market competition, and the role of the entrepreneur in the continual (but always incomplete) move toward equilibrium.
  • Klein, D. and Fielding, G. J. "Private Toll Roads: Learning from the Nineteenth Century." Transportation Quarterly, 7 (July), 321–341, 1992.
    • Discusses how roads, considered by many economists to be a classic public good, were provided on a fee-for-use basis in the nineteenth century, and what lessons can be learned from this example for contemporary transportation policy.
  • Kukathas, C. Hayek and Modern Liberalism. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989.
    • A sympathetic but critical appraisal of Hayek's social thought by a contemporary libertarian political theorist.
  • Kukathas, C. "The Mirage of Global Justice." Social Philosophy and Policy, 23 (1), 1–28, 2006.
    • A libertarian contribution to the debate on international justice, this paper argues that the political pursuit of global justice is an unworthy goal, and that the design of international institutions should be aimed at limiting power rather than securing justice.
  • Locke, J. The Second Treatise of Government. New York: MacMillan, 1952 [1689].
    • Locke's classic statement of his positive political philosophy, which expounds upon the ideas of natural law, property rights, and limited governments.
  • Lomasky, L. E. Persons, Rights, and the Moral Community. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1987.
    • A thorough and unique philosophical defense of classical liberalism, based on the idea that agents require liberty to pursue projects that matter to them, and must grant liberty to others to expect it themselves.
  • Lomasky, L. E. "Libertarianism at Twin Harvard." Social Philosophy and Policy, 22 (1), 178–199, 2005.
    • A playful piece that paints a picture of Twin Harvard (on Twin Earth) where Rawls is a libertarian and Nozick a welfare-state liberal, which suggests that Twin-Rawls and Twin-Nozick just might be more consistent than their real-world counterparts.
  • Mack, E. "Self-ownership, Marxism, and Egalitarianism: Part I: Challenges to Historical Entitlement." Politics, Philosophy and Economics, 1 (1), 75–108, 2002a.
    • A response to Cohen's criticism of Nozick, this piece defends the idea that rights to self-ownership legitimately yield unequal distributions of income and wealth.
  • Mack, E. "Self-ownership, Marxism, and Egalitarianism: Part II: Challenges to the Self-ownership Thesis." Politics, Philosophy and Economics, 1 (2), 237–276, 2002b.
    • This second part of Mack's response to Cohen defends the self-ownership thesis against his criticisms.
  • Mack, E. and Gaus, G. "Classical Liberalism and Libertarianism: The Liberty Tradition," in G. Gaus and C. Kukathas (eds.), Handbook of Political Theory. London: Sage, 2004.
    • A helpful discussion of classical liberalism and libertarianism, which focuses on the various commitments these theories share, and how their disagreement about the centrality or validity of some of these commitments divides the various members of this intellectual tradition.
  • Mill, J. S. "On Liberty,"in Stefan Collini (ed.), On Liberty and Other Writings. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989 [1859].
    • Mill's classic statement of the moral foundations of liberalism. Mill famously argues that each person should be at liberty to do as he wills so long as he does not harm others in doing so. One of the most influential defenses of individuality, free thought, and expression in the Western canon.
  • Mitchell, W. and Simmons, R. Beyond Politics: Markets, Welfare, and the Failure of Bureaucracy. San Francisco: Westview Press, 1994.
    • An accessible primer on public choice theory, with special focus on its implications for advocates of limited government.
  • Murray, C. Losing Ground: American Social Policy, 1950–1980. New York: Basic Books, 1984.
    • Argues that the growth of welfare in 1960s and 1970s America worsened the lot of poor and minority citizens, largely by eroding their incentive and ability to take responsibility for their lives.
  • Nagel, T. "Libertarianism Without Foundations." Yale Law Journal, 85, 136–149, 1975.
    • Argues that Nozick's defense of libertarianism is entirely unsuccessful insofar as it fails to provide a defense of the robust conception of individual rights that supports it.
  • Narveson, J. The Libertarian Idea. Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 1988.
    • A contractarian defense of libertarianism, inspired by the work of David Gauthier and Robert Nozick. Discusses both libertarian theory and its application to current controversies such as children's rights, zoning laws, and national defense.
  • Nozick, R. Anarchy, State, and Utopia. New York: Basic Books, 1974.
    • Nozick's classic statement of libertarian principles. Highlights include a lengthy criticism of Rawls's Theory of Justice, and a neglected third section on how a libertarian society serves as a "framework for utopia."
  • Otsuka, M. Libertarianism Without Inequality. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003.
    • One of the most recent systematic developments of left-libertarianism, combining individual rights to full self-ownership with the egalitarian principle of equal opportunity for welfare.
  • Otteson, J. Actual Ethics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006.
    • A Kantian defense of classical liberalism, centered on the idea of respect for persons, and developed with an Aristotelian conception of judgment.
  • Rand, A. "Man's Rights," in A. Rand, The Virtue of Selfishness. New York: Signet, 1963a.
  • Rand, A. "The Nature of Government," in A. Rand, The Virtue of Selfishness. New York: Signet, 1963b.
    • These two essays provide the core statement of Rand's political philosophy. While rejecting the label "libertarian," Rand here advocates a minimal state that uses force only in retaliation as the only political system compatible with man's rational nature.
  • Rasmussen, D. B. and Den Uyl, D. J. Liberty and Nature: An Aristotelian Defense of Liberal Order. La Salle: Open Court, 1991.
    • Drawing some inspiration from Rand's work, this text is one of the most thoroughgoing applications of Aristotelian moral philosophy to the defense of natural law and classical liberalism.
  • Rasmussen, D.B. and Den Uyl, D. J. Norms of Liberty: A Perfectionist Basis for Non-Perfectionist Politics. University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press, 2005.
    • A development of their earlier work, this view provides a more foundational defense for the authors' Aristotelian version of classical liberalism, and defends the view against communitarian and conservative critics.
  • Rawls, J. Political Liberalism. New York: Columbia University Press, 1993.
    • Rawls's classic expansion of his thoughts on domestic justice, following his seminal work A Theory of Justice (1971).
  • Rothbard, M. N. "Robert Nozick and the Immaculate Conception of the State." Journal of Libertarian Studies, 1 (1), 45–57, 1977.
    • Defends the anarcho-capitalist position against Nozick's arguments in the first part of Anarchy, State, and Utopia.
  • Rothbard, M. N. For a New Liberty. New York: Collier, 1978.
    • Rothbard's most accessible book, this volume sets out a natural rights basis for anarcho-capitalism. While weak in foundational moral theory, the volume provides a number of ingenious discussions of how a stateless society cold solve many pressing social and economic problems.
  • Rothbard, M. N. The Ethics of Liberty. New Jersey: Humanities Press, 1982.
    • This book explores many of the themes of Rothbard's For a New Liberty in greater theoretical depth. It develops Rothbard's theory of liberty, shows how it is incompatible with even a minimal state, and contrasts his position with those of von Mises, Hayek, and Robert Nozick.
  • Schmidtz, D. Elements of Justice. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006.
    • Develops a pluralist account of justice based on considerations of desert, reciprocity, equality, and need, and shows how a classical liberal conception of the state is sensitive to this wide array of moral concerns.
  • Schmidtz, D. and Goodin, R. Social Welfare and Individual Responsibility. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
    • Part of Cambridge University Press's "For and Against" series, this volume has Schmidtz presenting the case for limited government involvement in the promotion of individual welfare via market regulation and redistribution, and Goodin presenting the case for a more active welfare state. A very accessible and useful volume.
  • Shapiro, D. Is the Welfare State Justified? Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007.
    • Draws heavily on empirical research to argue that none of the dominant positions in contemporary political philosophy—egalitarianism, positive rights theory, communitarianism, and so on—support contemporary central welfare state institutions.
  • Skoble, A. Deleting the State.New York: Open Court Press, 2008.
    • An extended contemporary treatment of the case for anarcho-capitalism, arguing that centralized coercive political authority is incompatible with the value of liberty.
  • Smith, A. An Inquiry into the Nature and Causes of the Wealth of Nations, 2 vols. Indianapolis: Liberty Fund, 1981 [1776].
    • One of the most historically important statements of the economic case for free exchange. Smith's book remains a masterful statement of both the strengths and weaknesses of a market economy.
  • Steiner, H. An Essay on Rights. New York: Blackwell, 1994.
    • Sets forward a libertarian theory of rights that protect each individual's claim to self-ownership, but which allows for the redistribution of external goods. An influential left-libertarian work in the Lockean tradition of natural rights.
  • Thornton, M. The Economics of Prohibition. Salt Lake City: University of Utah Press, 1991.
    • An application of the Austrian theory of economics to the issue of drug and alcohol prohibition, which argues that all such prohibitions should be repealed.
  • Vallentyne, P. "Left-Libertarianism: A Primer," in P. Vallentyne and H. Steiner (eds.), Left Libertarianism and its Critics: The Contemporary Debate. New York: Palgrave, 2000.
    • A useful overview of the core commitments of left-libertarianism, its historical origins and contemporary development, and its responses to common objections.
  • von Mises, L. Socialism: An Economic and Sociological Analysis. J. Kahane (transl.). Indianapolis: Liberty Fund, 1981 [1922].
    • A thorough critique of socialism from one of the leading figures in Austrian economics. Contains Mises's famous argument that economic calculation in a purely socialist society is impossible, given its lack of a free price system to convey information about relative supply and demand.
  • Waldron, J. "Two Worries About Mixing One's Labour." The Philosophical Quarterly, 33 (130), 37–44, 1983.
    • Argues that the Lockean idea of mixing one's labor with external property is incoherent and adds nothing to whatever other arguments Locke might have for the justification of private property.

Author Information

Matt Zwolinski
University of San Diego
U. S. A.

William Edward Burghardt Du Bois (1868—1963)

duboisW. E. B. Du Bois was an important American thinker: a poet, philosopher, economic historian, sociologist, and social critic. His work resists easy classification. This article focuses exclusively on Du Bois' contribution to philosophy; but the reader must keep in mind throughout that Du Bois is more than a philosopher; he is, for many, a great social leader. His extensive efforts all bend toward a common goal, the equality of colored people. His philosophy is significant today because it addresses what many would argue is the real world problem of white domination. So long as racist white privilege exists, and suppresses the dreams and the freedoms of human beings, so long will Du Bois be relevant as a thinker, for he, more than almost any other, employed thought in the service of exposing this privilege, and worked to eliminate it in the service of a greater humanity. Du Bois' pragmatist philosophy, as well as his other work, underlies and supports this larger social aim. Later in life, Du Bois turned to communism as the means to achieve equality. He envisioned communism as a society that promoted the well being of all its members, not simply a few. Du Bois came to believe that the economic condition of Africans and African-Americans was one of the primary modes of their oppression, and that a more equitable distribution of wealth, as advanced by Marx, was the remedy for the situation.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. General Philosophical Orientation
  3. Double Consciousness
  4. Second Sight
  5. Critique of White Imperialism
  6. Later Marxism
  7. Du Bois' Significance Today
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

Du Bois was born in Great Barrington, Massachusetts, on February 23, 1868. He had a happy early childhood, largely unaware of race prejudice, until one day, as he records in Souls of Black Folk, a student in his class refused to exchange greeting cards with him simply because he was black (Souls, 2). This experience made Du Bois feel for the first time that he was different, in that he was both inside the white world (since he lived within it) and outside of it (since he was perceived in the white world through the lens of race prejudice). Throughout his life after this event, Du Bois was continually made to feel, as he says, that he was both an American and an African, but never an African-American, with his own distinct, coherent identity in the American world. "One ever feels his two-ness," he explains (Souls, 2).

Du Bois refused to become depressed by his new realization, and in fact made it his life's work to combat race prejudice and to find a way to achieve coherent personhood for blacks in America. Du Bois, it turns out, was just the right person for the job, since he had it in his character to affirm himself as a matter of course. He was a bold, courageous youth, willing to fight for himself and his peers. All his life Du Bois was self-assertive without being aggressive, assuming without hesitation the right to equality of all people.

Knowing his mission early on, Du Bois headed to school to become educated adequately to realize it (a task not without struggle in the virulently racist world of the times). He attended Fisk University as an undergraduate student and Harvard University as a graduate student as well as studied abroad in Germany. He was the first African-American to be awarded a Ph.D. from Harvard. At Harvard, he studied philosophy under William James, George Santayana, and Josiah Royce. Du Bois learned a lot from his philosophy teachers, especially James, but he came to reject academic philosophy, referring to it as "lovely but sterile" (Lewis, Biography 92). He turned to history and sociology instead.

Du Bois' dissertation reflects this new direction. It is entitled The Suppression of the African Slave Trade to the United States of America, 1638-1870. Du Bois began to turn his energies to a socio-economic analysis of the African-American situation. His efforts were guided by the belief that a proper understanding of this situation would help eliminate racism; if people only understood properly what African-Americans were going through, Du Bois felt, they would appreciate better the circumstances that they face and would work toward their full liberation and flourishing. This line of thought led to the publication of The Philadelphia Negro in 1899.

Du Bois' most important work, The Souls of Black Folk, was published in 1903, and reflects an important new direction of his thinking. This is the work for which he is most renowned, the work in which he declared, famously, that "the problem of the Twentieth Century is the problem of the color-line" (Souls, V). About this work, Du Bois' biographer writes, "It was one of those events epochally dividing history into a before and an after" (Lewis, Biography 277). What makes this work so important, culturally, is the way in which it speaks out passionately and uncompromisingly about the spirit of African-Americans, emphasizing their humanity and strength despite centuries of the worst oppression. In addition, Du Bois in this book dared to challenge the most famous African-American intellectual of the day, Booker T. Washington, and to assert an opposing principle to Washington's belief that industrial education alone would lead to equality. Du Bois argued instead that African-Americans must be given the chance to attain the most sophisticated, higher education as well, so that they might partake of the goods of civilization as well as be fit candidates to educate other African-Americans in turn (a task not to be left fully to whites).

The Souls of Black Folk is a work rich in philosophical content, as will be discussed in more detail below. For now, however, it should be noted that Du Bois shifts direction in this work and takes a novel approach from his previous work. Still trying to build understanding and sympathy for the situation of African-Americans, especially in the period after Reconstruction, Du Bois now combines socio-economic research with poetry, song, story, and philosophy. A new, multi-faceted voice grips Du Bois, allowing him, in what can only be called a great and profound piece of literature, to pierce the mind of his readers and to make them feel overwhelmingly the significance of being black in America.

In his middle works, most notably Darkwater, published in 1919, Du Bois changes directions again, as Manning Marable notes (Marable, vi). This time, instead of trying to make the reader gently understand, Du Bois lambastes the reader for failing to understand. Darkwater is a fiery, accosting work, in which Du Bois makes such claims as that "white Christianity is a miserable failure" because of its racism (Darkwater, 21), and that white civilization is to a large extent "mutilation and rape masquerading as culture" (Darkwater, 21). Du Bois' new approach consists of the attempt to wake up the reader from their racist slumber, to force them to see the racism wherever it is for what it is.

This work, in which Du Bois asserts that, "a belief in humanity is a belief in colored men" (Darkwater, 27), has become particularly important for later, critical race theory (see below). It is worth noting about the work for now that again Du Bois blends philosophy, poetry, literature, history, and sociology in a unique, energizing manner that was to remain his stylistic trademark.

Du Bois' later works include Dusk of Dawn (1940), his "autobiography of a concept of race." It also includes Black Folk, Then and Now: An Essay in the History and Sociology of the Negro Race (1939), in which he endorses a form of Marxist critique, and the posthumously published Autobiography of W. E. B. Du Bois (1968), which contains reflections on his life in its last decade.

Throughout his life, in addition to writing, Du Bois worked as an activist for social causes. He was editor of the journal, Crisis (1910-1919), which explored contemporary racial problems and how to combat them. He helped found the National Association for the Advancement of Colored People (NAACP) as well as the Pan African Congress. He ran for the U.S. Senate in order to help improve the plight of African Americans. Later in life, as the chair of the Peace Information Center, he called for banishing atomic weapons and making them illegal (Lewis; Hynes).

In 1959, after a lifetime of combating rampant racism in the U.S., Du Bois had enough and expatriated to Ghana, Africa. He spent his time in Africa working on an Encyclopedia of African Peoples and refining his social analysis, which had come to include Marxist elements (he became an official member of the U.S. Communist Party before his departure). Du Bois died in Accra, Ghana, on August 27, 1963---immediately before the March on Washington that inaugurated the civil rights movement in America, as several commentators have observed (Lewis; Hynes).

2. General Philosophical Orientation

Philosophically speaking, Du Bois' work is difficult to characterize, since he lived and wrote for such a long time and refined his position over so many years. Eugene C. Holmes has described Du Bois as a materialist and a social philosopher (Holmes, 80-1). According to Holmes, "with Dr. Du was always the problem of getting the truth about race by means of a scientific approach" (Holmes, 77).

Recent scholarship has adopted a more nuanced perspective. Cornel West puts Du Bois decidedly in the camp of the pragmatists, that is, in the camp of someone who works in the "Emersonian tradition" of evading traditional philosophical problems altogether and turning instead to the empowerment of individuals and communities. What Du Bois adds to the pragmatists, according to West, is an impassioned and focused concern for "the wretched of the earth" and for thinking about how one can alleviate their plight (West, 138). Other more recent approaches tend to see Du Bois as a highly important critical theorist, or someone whose work is inherently and purposefully interdisciplinary in nature, drawing on multiple disciplines as needed to critique power, especially white power (Rabaka, 2). This view would seemed to be confirmed by Du Bois' biographer, who concludes his painstakingly thorough account of Du Bois' life and work by noting that Du Bois, in essence, "attempted virtually every possible solution to the problem of twentieth century racism---scholarship, communism" (Lewis, The Fight for Equality, 571). Hence, the traditional view of Du Bois as always concerned with getting at the truth about race through science would seem to be contradicted by recent scholarship, which holds that Du Bois tried multiple, irreconcilable approaches (even propaganda) to achieve his ends.

Even so, there remains important recent scholarship that sees Du Bois as a more traditional philosopher, concerned with the ideals of truth, goodness, and beauty. According to Keith Byerman, for example, Du Bois possesses "confidence in his grasp of truth," and his autobiographies, for one, are stories in which he always gains "a fuller view of truth" (Byerman, 7). The truth that Du Bois realizes, according to Byerman, is that there is a "Law of the Father," which "challenges the corrupt father... By supplanting the father, the son can install an "empire" of reason, morality, and beauty to replace arbitrary power and self-interest" (Byerman, 7-8). On this reading, which is Platonic in many ways, truth, goodness, and beauty are ideal qualities by appeal to which Du Bois judges and condemns the corrupt world of racial inequality.

Overall, then, we can see that the general interpretation of Du Bois' philosophy is contested ground, and that no clear-cut, agreed-upon definition of it emerges from the scholarship. Some Continental Philosophers have even identified Du Bois as Hegelian in a crucial respect (or at least as having "held out as ideal" one of Hegel's main goals) (Higgins, 58). The point is made that, like Hegel, the Du Boisian self is also torn asunder, divided within itself, only to have to struggle to attain a higher synthesis of identity in a new formation. Materialist, Pragmatist, Critical Theorist, Platonist, Hegelian---Du Bois' general philosophical orientation is far from having been finally determined.

3. Double Consciousness

Whatever turns out to be the best general account of Du Bois' philosophy, it seems the significance of his thought only really shows up in the specific details of his works themselves, especially in The Souls of Black Folk. It is here that he first develops his central philosophical concept, the concept of double consciousness, and spells out its full implications.

The aim of Souls of Black Folk is to show the spirit of black people in the United States: to show their humanity and the predicament that has confronted their humanity. Du Bois asserts that "the color line" divides people in the States, causes massive harm to its inhabitants, and ruins its own pretensions to democracy. He shows, in particular, how a veil has come to be put over African-Americans, so that others do not see them as they are; African-Americans are obscured in America; they cannot be seen clearly, but only through the lens of race prejudice. African-Americans feel this alien perception upon them but at the same time feel themselves as themselves, as their own with their own legitimate feelings and traditions. This dual self-perception is known as "double consciousness." Du Bois' aim in Souls is to explain this concept in more specific detail and to show how it adversely affects African-Americans. In the background of Souls is always also the moral import of its message, to the effect that the insertion of a veil on human beings is wrong and must be condemned on the grounds that it divides what otherwise would be a unique and coherent identity. Souls thus aims to make the reader understand, in effect, that African-Americans have a distinct cultural identity, one that must be acknowledged, respected, and enabled to flourish.

Souls contains a Forethought, fourteen chapters, and an Afterthought. Each chapter is preceded by a bar of African-American spiritual music coupled with a poem.

The Forethought tells us the plan of the work: to present "the spiritual world in which ten thousand Americans live and strive" (Souls, v). Chapter 1, "Of Our Spiritual Strivings," is perhaps the most important chapter of the book from a strictly philosophical perspective. Here Du Bois lays out the basic concept of double consciousness, while the remainder of the work provides concrete instances of the concept. The Afterthought, rich and powerful in poetic imagery, implores the reader not to let Du Bois' "leaves" fail to take root: it is an impassioned call to action based on the book's insights.

"An American, a Negro; two souls, two thoughts, two unreconciled strivings"---with these words from Chapter 1, Du Bois highlights the extreme tension involved in double consciousness (Souls, 2). Or, as he also expresses the point, "Why did God make me an outcast and a stranger in mine own house?" (Souls, 2). Double consciousness is the awareness of being a split person, a dual self whose different parts are at dire odds with one another. The American self in a person, such as America was then constituted, works against the Negro self; while the Negro self, resisting as it must such a constitution, works against the American self. In one person, therefore, we have two deeply divided tendencies.

Du Bois does not conceive this division to be a good thing; he conceives it, indeed, as positively unhealthy and problematic. He refers to it as "this waste of double aims, this seeking to satisfy two unreconciled ideals," which "has wrought sad havoc with the courage and faith and deeds of ten thousand people" (Souls, 3). Not knowing which particular direction to turn, always fighting against oneself in either direction, what double consciousness prevents is the attainment of "self-conscious manhood," a coherent sense of self and direction, the ability "to merge his double self into a better and truer self" (Souls, 2).

In Du Bois' conception, the human self is thus capable of being cut or split, and at the same time capable of growing back together again and becoming, as he says, better and even more true. Of course, a truer self implies something like truth---and thus we can see that Du Bois holds to the idea of a more genuine ideal of a person, specifically of African-Americans. Du Bois' idea is that African-Americans have in truth a unique, valuable identity but that current conditions keep this identity from forming or at least becoming fully active and available. We can see here, too, Du Bois' famous call for allowing African-Americans to become genuine participants in American culture, "to be a co-worker in the kingdom of culture" (Souls, 3), in such a way that American culture could only benefit by the inclusion of its own genuine members. Du Bois does not wish to eliminate white American culture nor Negro culture in America. He wishes to fuse the two into a genuine new element, "in order that some day on American soil two world-races may give each to each those characteristics both so sadly lack" (Souls, 7). Through recognition of a place for African-Americans in American culture, Du Bois wishes to achieve a genuine American culture as well: "the ideal of human brotherhood, gained through the unifying ideal of Race" (Souls, 7).

In the remaining chapters of Souls, Du Bois provides some rather powerful (and tragic) instances of the struggles with dual selfhood that African-Americans have had to undergo. A key idea of Chapter 1 is to show what Reconstruction meant for African-Americans: the chance not only to be free, and educated, and to have the vote, but more importantly (as Du Bois argues it) to become whole human beings. Chapter 2 examines the aftermath of Reconstruction and shows how Reconstruction (in the form of the Freedmen's Bureau) at first worked slowly toward, but then ultimately failed to achieve, this ideal. Chapter 3 continues to show how the ideal failed to develop by pointing to the slow and ineffective rise of leadership of African-Americans. It is in this chapter that Du Bois famously challenges Booker T. Washington for his call to lead blacks through industrial education without the inclusion of higher learning. How, Du Bois reasons, can African-Americans become "co-workers in the kingdom of culture" if they are only trained in the sterile practice of moneymaking? In Chapters 4 and 5, Du Bois takes his readers further into the idea of the veil, taking a look both inside it and outside in each chapter, respectively. By Chapter 6, we realize that the main problem in achieving coherent personhood for African-Americans is education. Chapters 7 and 8 outline the struggles that the masses of African-American workers, in particular, have undergone. Chapter 9 turns toward the present relations between African-Americans and white Americans. It focuses, in particular, on the manners and modes of segregation that keep the best of whites living apart from the best of African-Americans, thereby preventing a fruitful fusion of cultures. In Chapter 10, Du Bois purports to lift the veil, so that whites can see inside and especially appreciate the religious sense and striving of African Americans. He shows that the meaning of the religion is that it constitutes a special place where the kind of community and life for African-Americans can be attained that the white world denies them. Religion has had to become a refuge, but also at the same time a source of genuine freedom of expression and creativity. Chapter 11, which is very moving, recounts the birth (and loss) of Du Bois' own son as an instance of his own struggle against white culture. Here Du Bois laments that his newborn, innocent son will soon have to cross into the color line of hateful American prejudice. Chapters 12 and 13 discuss the struggles that great African-American souls had to deal with to become more fully appreciated, including a narrative about a man named John who defended his sister against dishonor only to be met with horrible racism as a result. Chapter 14, the last chapter, closes with a rich discussion of African-American music in which Du Bois points to this music as an emblem of the possible brighter future in which African-Americans become co-workers in American culture. Such music is the symbol of this better future in which African-Americans contribute to the culture since it is, after all, he claims, the only genuinely beautiful music that has come out of America to date, and reveals what African-Americans can accomplish.

Thus, Du Bois provides us with multiple instances of double consciousness. In each case, African-Americans are shown to be struggling to achieve themselves, due to the enforced divisions and roadblocks of white culture. What Du Bois presents here are short, powerful looks at the struggle to be recognized as fully human, a struggle due to the horrible crime of racism. The concept of double consciousness plays itself out in a variety of ways---from the agonizing worry a father feels in raising his son in a white world to the failed policies of segregation and the creation of ghettos in American cities---always with the same devastating effect, the compromising of identity, and yet with a new identity that is forming and emerging. The African-American is forced to struggle to be him- or herself in America, Du Bois shows, but they have done so heroically and with deep humanity throughout their plight.

Some Du Bois interpreters (Higgins) have found parallels between Du Bois' conception of double consciousness and Nietzsche's conception of the free spirit, or the man who stands apart. The idea is that in both cases someone within the culture is at the same time able to stand outside of it. But as we have seen above, beyond this general notion, Du Bois clearly develops his concept of double consciousness in the context of African-Americans specifically. Nor does he favor this sense of division in the way that Nietzsche sometimes seems to do but rather he actively seeks to overcome it.

The overall implication of Souls is that such enforced separation of consciousness as occurs in the case of African-Americans is wrong; it violates something fundamental about the human condition, and it ruins our republic, by preventing us from forming the best use of our talents by drawing on the strengths of all races. We must work together to attain a greater sense of personhood for the members of our culture.

4. Second Sight

Du Bois' other major philosophical concept is that of "second sight." This is a concept he develops most precisely in Darkwater, a work, as we have seen, in which Du Bois changes his approach and takes up a stauncher stance against white culture.

Du Bois holds that due to their double consciousness, African-Americans possess a privileged epistemological perspective. Both inside the white world and outside of it, African-Americans are able to understand the white world, while yet perceiving it from a different perspective, namely that of an outsider as well.

The white person in America, by contrast, contains but a single consciousness and perspective, for he or she is a member of a dominant culture, with its own racial and cultural norms asserted as absolute. The white person looks out from themselves and sees only their own world reflected back upon them---a kind of blindness or singular sight possesses them. Luckily, as Du Bois makes clear, the dual perspective of African-Americans can be used to grasp the essence of whiteness and to expose it, in the multiple senses of the word "expose." That is to say, second sight allows an African-American to bring the white view out into the open, to lay it bare, and to let it wither for the problematic and wrong-headed concept that it is. The destruction of "whiteness" in this way leaves whites open to the experience of African-Americans, as a privileged perspective, and hence it also leaves African-Americans with a breach in the culture through which they could enter with their legitimate, and legitimating, perspectives.

5. Critique of White Imperialism

In a particularly important essay of Dark Water, called "The Souls of White Folk," Du Bois reveals some of the wisdom of his race's privileged perspective. As Du Bois sees it, whites see themselves a certain way, namely as superior, civilized, perfect, beneficent, and called upon to help other peoples with their higher wisdom. But, in truth, as African-Americans can perceive quite plainly, whites are actually imperialistic, ugly, greedy, and corrupt in their practices. Whites are imprisoned in their own false self-conception. Their own seriousness with themselves contrasts sharply with the reality that African-Americans see. What they see, above all, is that white society consists not of higher wisdom but only of "mutilation and rape masquerading as culture" (Darkwater, 21).

Du Bois makes his claims more pointed and specific by noting that the concept of "whiteness" is what we might today call a social construct. It is a concept that developed in the late nineteenth century and in the twentieth century. Before that, various societies hardly made much of differences in skin color. What is significant about this fact is that it shows whiteness as a category to emerge simultaneously with the development of industrialism and its counterpart colonialism. Western peoples wanted the material resources of the third world, and so they invented the myth of their own superiority based on skin color, and the supposed inferiority of dark peoples, in order to assist them in their desire to steal.

Based on such maneuvers as these, the third world was conquered, dark peoples were murdered, raped, and exploited, and white culture became rich. This wealth and power in turn gave whites a sense of superiority. But this sense of superiority is undone by the tragic-comic self-conception whites have of themselves as superior simply because they are white, when in fact they are bound to a false, invented self-conception based on color, one that only serves to assist in murder and exploitation. The supposedly civilized concept of "whiteness" in truth sinks into barbarism and insatiable world conquest.

And it is this, precisely, that whites cannot see about themselves, but must learn to see, if the problem of the twentieth century, the problem of the color line, is to be overcome and the races are to create together a greater and truer democracy.

6. Later Marxism

Later in life, Du Bois turned to communism as the means to achieve equality. As he put it in his autobiography, "I now state my conclusion frankly and clearly: I believe in communism. I mean by communism, a planned way of life in the production of wealth and work designed for building a state whose object is the highest welfare of its people and not merely the profit of a part" (Autobiography, 57). Du Bois came to believe that the economic condition of Africans and African-Americans was one of the primary modes of their oppression, and that a more equitable distribution of wealth, as advanced by Marx, was the remedy to the situation.

Du Bois was not simply a follower of Marx, however. He also added keen insights to the communist tradition himself. One of his contributions is his insistence that communism contains no explicit means of liberating Africans and African-Americans, but that it ought to focus its attentions here and work toward this end. "The darker races," to use Du Bois' language, amount to the majority of the world's proletariat. Without their liberation and motive force in the production of communism, it cannot be achieved. In Black Folk, Then and Now, Du Bois writes: "the dark workers of Asia, Africa, the islands of the sea, and South and Central America...these are the one who are supporting a superstructure of wealth, luxury, and extravagance. It is the rise of these people that is the rise of the world" (Black Folk, 383).

A further contribution Du Bois makes is to show how Utopian politics such as communism is possible in the first place. Building on Engle's claim that freedom lies in the acknowledgment of necessity, as Maynard Solomon argues (Solomon, "Introduction" 258), (because in grasping necessity we accurately perceive what areas of life are open to free action), Du Bois insists on the power of dreams. Admitting our bound nature (bound to our bellies, bound to material conditions), even stressing it, he nonetheless emphasizes our range of powers within these constraints. In a lecture called "The Nature of Intellectual Freedom" that he delivered to the Cultural and Scientific Conference for World Peace in 1949, using language that anticipates Jean-Paul Sartre, Du Bois calls attention to "the upsurging emotions," the mind's ability to go beyond what is present (259). Also like Sartre, Du Bois attempts to employ this power behalf of socialism. As Du Bois sees it, the human mind has the ability to take flight into "infinite freedoms" ("The Nature," 259). This "upsurging" ability of mind is vital to bringing about socialism, for it allows us to dream of what life and social conditions might be as compared to what they currently are (Solomon, "Introduction," 258). If properly cultivated, it allows us to see beyond the supposed necessity of the capitalist system, which everywhere presents itself, falsely, as the only way. Imagination surpasses untruth.

There is, as Du Bois points out ("The Nature," 260), and Solomon confirms (Solomon, "Introduction," 258), a "borderland" region in which compulsion and freedom meet. We must gain food, seek shelter, and raise our children. Necessity and liberty meet each other half way in this region, each pulling in their own direction, yet oftentimes working together. Our leaders take advantage of this region. They enforce necessity to work hard and to work in order to eat---in order, ultimately, to stifle individual freedom and its meanderings, its free decisions; and they promote ignorance of conditions in order to make us more beholden to them. However, there is hope in the fact that freedom also operates in this border region and that our minds can shape a part of what occurs in this region. Socialism must focus here and nurture this hope. It must promote, above all, "the dreaming of dreams by untwisted souls," that our dreams might someday lead to better realities ("The Nature," 260).

7. Du Bois' Significance Today

Although difficult to characterize in general terms, Du Bois' philosophy amounts to a programmatic shift away from abstraction and toward engaged, social criticism. In affecting this change in philosophy, especially on behalf of African-Americans and pertaining to the issue of race, Du Bois adds concrete significance and urgent application to American Pragmatism, as Cornel West maintains, a philosophy that is about social criticism, not about grasping absolute timeless truth.

Du Bois' work has also been essential for Africana Critical Theory, and has influenced a host of thinkers in this tradition, as Rabaka has shown. Authors have often compared Du Bois' work to that of Frantz Fanon in its call to overcome global race prejudice and to liberate Africa. In addition, Du Bois' philosophy was a focus point for some of the work of Dr. Martin Luther King, Jr., among many other thinkers, who praised it highly for its commitment to truth about African-American experience and history (Rabaka, 35).

Du Bois' philosophy has also contributed significantly to critical race theory, especially his article, "The Conservation of Races," in which Du Bois argues, echoing Souls, that there is some real meaning to race, even if it is difficult precisely to define (Conservation, 84-85). As Robert Bernasconi makes clear, Du Bois is a central figure in the debate about the nature of race because he has triggered an intense discussion about the extent to which there is a biological basis to race and the extent to which social and cultural features define race as well ("Introduction," 1-2).

With his concept of second sight, and the privileged perspective of minorities, Du Bois also anticipates, if not single handedly creates, Standpoint Theory in epistemology, which holds that minorities are better equipped to gain knowledge about the world than members of the dominant culture. Du Bois' social philosophy also adds an important element to Marxism by focusing on the racial elements of oppression and their function in relation to class warfare. Moreover, his philosophy also anticipates certain French Feminists, such as Luce Irigaray, who demonstrate how culture mirrors back to us the image of our selves to the detriment of minorities.

Above all, however, Du Bois' philosophy is significant today because it addresses what many would argue is the real world problem of white domination. So long as racist white privilege exists, and suppresses the dreams and the freedoms of human beings, so long will Du Bois be relevant as a thinker, for he, more than almost any other, employed thought in the service of exposing this privilege, and worked to eliminate it in the service of a greater humanity.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Bernasconi, Robert. "Introduction," in Race, ed. Robert Bernasconi (Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 2001).
  • Byerman, Keith E. Seizing the Word: History, Art, and Self in the Work of W. E. B. Du Bois (Athens: University of Georgia Press, 1994).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. Black Folk, Then and Now (Millwood, N.Y.: Kraus-Thomson Organization Limited, 1975).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. Darkwater: Voices From Within the Veil (Mineola, N. Y. Dover Publications, 1999).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. Dusk of Dawn: An Essay Toward an Autobiography of a Race Concept (New York: Schocken Books, 1968).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. The Autobiography of W. E. B. Du Bois: A Soliloquy on Viewing My Life from the Last Decade of its First Century (New York: International Publishers, 1980).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. "The Conservation of Races," in Race, ed. Robert Bernasconi (Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 2001).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. "The Nature of Intellectual Freedom," in Solomon, Maynard, ed., Marxism and Art: Essays Classic and Contemporary (New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 1973).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. The Souls of Black Folk (New York: Dover Publications, 1994).
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. "The Talented Tenth." 3/13/2006. <>.
  • Harding, Sandra. The Feminist Standpoint Theory Reader: Intellectual and Political Controversies (London: Routledge, 2003).
  • Higgins, Kathleen. "Double Consciousness and Second Sight," in Critical Affinities: Nietzsche and African American Thought, ed., Jacqueline Scott and A. Todd Franklin (Albany: State University of New York Press, 2006).
  • Holmes, Eugene C. "W. E. B. Du Bois: Philosopher," in Black Titan: W. E. B. Du Bois (Boston: Beacon Press, 1970).
  • Hynes, Gerald C. "A Biographical Sketch of W. E. B. Du Bois." 3/10/2006. http://www.
  • Irigaray, Luce. Speculum of the Other Woman. Trans. Gillian G. Gill (New York: Cornell University Press, 1974).
  • Lewis, David Levering. W. E. B. Du Bois: Biography of a Race: 1868-1919 (New York: Henry Holt, 1993).
  • Lewis, David Levering. W. E. B. Du Bois: The Fight for Equality and the American Century: 1919-1963 (New York: Henry Holt, 2000).
  • Marable, Manning, "Introduction," Darkwater: Voices From Within the Veil. By W. E. B. Du Bois (Mineola, N. Y. Dover Publications, 1999), v-viii.
  • Marable, Manning. W.E.B. Du Bois: Black Radical Democrat (Boulder, Colorado: Paradigm Publishers, 2005).
  • Rabaka, Reiland. W. E. B. Du Bois and the Problems of the Twenty-First Century: An Essay on Africana Critical Theory (Lanham, MD.: Lexington Books, 2007).
  • Solomon, Maynard, "Introduction," in Marxism and Art: Essays Classic and Contemporary, Ed., Maynard Solomon (New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 1973).
  • West, Cornel. The American Evasion of Philosophy: A Genealogy of Pragmatism (Madison, WI: The University of Wisconsin Press, 1989).

Author Information

Donald J. Morse
Webster University
U. S. A.

Moral Egalitarianism

Egalitarianism is the position that equality is central to justice. It is a prominent trend in social and political philosophy and has also become relevant in moral philosophy (moral egalitarianism) since the late twentieth century. In social and political philosophy, the main focus of the debate is on two different trends, the Equality-of-What trend and the Why-Equality trend. The authors of the older, first trend focused on the main question, what the goods of distribution are (resources, equality of opportunity for welfare, and so forth) and according to which standard one should distribute the goods. The question, in the late twentieth century is, whether equality is the most or one of the most important part(s) of justice or whether it has no or nearly no importance for the nature of justice at all. Egalitarians believe that justice and equality are closely connected; prioritarians, instead, emphasise that the two concepts are unrelated. This article gives an overview of the main arguments and objections in the Why-Equality debate. These are the by-product objection of equality, the objection of inhumanity, the objection of complexity, the argument of the presumption of equality, and the argument for a pluralistic egalitarianism.

Table of Contents

  1. Preliminary Distinctions
  2. On some Difficulties within the Why-Equality Debate
  3. Objections to Moral Egalitarianism
    1. The By-Product Objection of Equality
    2. The Objection of Inhumanity
      1. The Fault is-Up-to-Them Objection
      2. The Objection of Stigmatizing
      3. The Tutelage Objection
    3. The Objection of Complexity
  4. Two Egalitarian Arguments
    1. The Egalitarians’ Assumption of the Presumption of Equality
    2. Pluralistic Egalitarianism
  5. Reference and Further Reading

1. Preliminary Distinctions

Egalitarianism is the position that equality is central to justice. It is a prominent trend in social and political philosophy and has also become relevant in moral philosophy (moral egalitarianism) since the late twentieth century. The very question is, whether equality is the most or one of the most important part(s) of justice or whether it has no or nearly no importance for the nature of justice at all (‘Why-Equality’). Egalitarians believe that justice and equality are closely connected; prioritarians, instead, emphasise that both concepts are not related.

Egalitarians think, firstly, that unfair life prospects should be equalized. Secondly, that equality is the most or one of the most important irreducible intrinsic or constitutive worth(s) of justice. Thirdly, that welfare should be increased. Fourthly, that justice is comparative. Fifthly, that inequalities are just when otherwise advantages are destroyed in the name of justice. Lastly, that there are certain absolute humanitarian principles like autonomy, freedom or human dignity.

Prioritarians think, firstly, that equality itself cannot be a foundation of justice and that it is no important irreducible aim of justice, it has no intrinsic moral worth (Frankfurt 1997) and it has no or at least no fundamental importance with regard to the justification of justice, it is rather a by-product, although it has some importance as reducible worth (Raz 1986). Secondly, the fulfilment of absolute standards like human dignity, respect, or citizenship are of utmost importance to give people the opportunity to live a human being-worthy life and not a life in miserable circumstances (Walzer 1983; Raz 1986; Frankfurt 1997; Parfit 1998; Anderson 1999). Thirdly, people should have access to food and shelter, basic medical supply, or should have private and political autonomy, and so forth. Fourthly, equality has some importance (i) in being a by-product, or (ii) in being one part among other parts as a comparative factor, (e.g., in equality before the law, concerning equal chances, or with regard to the prohibition of discrimination), or (iii) in being a precondition for the fulfilment of certain absolute standards like political autonomy, social affiliation, and liberty of exchange (Krebs 2000, 2003).

2. On some Difficulties within the Why-Equality Debate

The main question, whether egalitarianism or prioritarianism has the most plausible conception of the relation between justice and equality, has not been successfully answered, yet. There had been attacks from both sides, which show that they did not attack the strongest but a weak version of the opponents’ view. A second mistake is the fact that the notions of justice and equality are also discussed – to a great extent – under the heading of questions of distributions, although this had been the main point of the ‘Equality-of-What’ debate, e.g. ‘equality of resources’ (Rawls 1971, 1993; Dworkin 1981; Rakowski 1991; van Parijs 1995), ‘equality of opportunity for welfare’ (Arneson 1989; Cohen 1989; Roemer 1996, 1998), or ‘equality of capability to function’ (Sen 1992). This is a misleading focus, especially if one wants to determine the relation between these two important notions with regard to the question of justification. Questions of distributions are just one part of the story. Thirdly, the two most extreme assumptions (i) justice is equality and (ii) justice has nothing to do with equality are unsound, since common sense can easily show that these assumptions are out of sight right from the beginning. The interesting and more appropriated ones are situated right in-between. Equality should not be discussed in socioeconomic circumstances only, but also in the moral and political realm.

3. Objections to Moral Egalitarianism

The main objections against the egalitarians made by the prioritarians are, firstly, the by-product objection of equality (Raz 1986; Frankfurt 1987, 1997; Parfit 1998), secondly, the objection of inhumanity (Anderson 1999) and, thirdly, the objection of complexity (Walzer 1983).

a. The By-Product Objection of Equality

Firstly, the egalitarian view that equality is the central aim or one of the most important aims of justice and should not be seen as a mere by-product had been a mayor point of criticism on the prioritarian side (Raz 1986: 218-221, 227-229; Frankfurt 1987: 32-34 and 1997: 7 and 11; Parfit 1998: 13-15). They think that equality is a mere by-product and it is due to absolute standards like human dignity or respect, and so forth, whereas egalitarian equality is due to relational standards.

Prioritarians argue that in cases of people’s hunger and illness or deficiency of goods they should be helped because hunger, illness, and deficiency of goods are terrible circumstances for every human being and not because other people are in a better condition. The hunger and illness of other people or the deficiency of goods directly put us in the situation to help these people without making any comparison between them and those people who are better off. Frankfurt says that substantial – and not formal – definitions certainly have genuine moral importance and that it depends on human beings who live a good life and not on how their life is with regard to other human beings’ lives (Frankfurt 1997: 6). It seems that prioritarians think that egalitarians worship equality for the sake of equality only. In cases of illness, hunger and deficiency of goods the role of equality is not that simple as prioritarians want to make other people believe. Their objection loses its power, if one acknowledges that people in cases of illness, hunger or deficiency of goods should be treated equally as human beings if they get supply, that means there is no primarily discrimination ongoing. Equality has many faces and impartiality is one of it. There is room for proportional equality in cases of, for instance, deficiency of goods. This is no contradiction within the egalitarian view – proportional equality is part of equality. The idea that equality always means arithmetical equality is not justified.

The second example is Parfit’s ‘levelling down objection’ (Parfit 1998: chapter 4). Given that inequalities as such are bad, their disappearance would be, in one respect, a change to something, which is better. If, says Parfit, the better off people lose all their additional resources by a natural disaster and thus are in the same terrible situation than the other people, it will be something that teleological egalitarians may welcome, though some people lost all of their additional resources and nobody else could profit. Or, in the famous example given by Parfit: ‘Similarly, it would be in one way an improvement if we destroyed the eyes of the sighted, not to benefit the blind, but only to make the sighted blind. These implications can be more plausibly regarded as monstrous, or absurd.’ (Parfit 1998: chapter 4). Parfit knows that this would be not enough to criticize the egalitarians by using this objection, ‘it is not enough to claim that it would be wrong to produce equality by levelling down.’ Therefore he states: ‘Our objection must be that, if we achieve equality by levelling down, there is nothing good about what we have done. Similarly, if some natural disaster makes everyone equally badly off, that is not in any way good news.’ (Parfit 1998: chapter 4). It seems Parfit is thinking of an opponent who does everything for his worshipping of equality – that is, equality for the sake of equality. Plain egalitarians claim that inequalities are justified, if the only means to remove inequality would be to ‘level down’ the better off people to the standard of the badly off people, without any improvement with regard to the badly off people. The destruction of advantages in the name of justice is also unacceptable on the egalitarian view. There is a lot of rhetoric in this kind of objection. Parfit makes a distinction between the teleological and the deontic egalitarianism in this passage. And it is only the teleological egalitarianism, in Parfit’s view, that is open for criticism. The deontic egalitarian, unlike the teleological egalitarian, has no problem with the view that inequality itself is not bad in a way. But, says Parfit, ‘we may find it harder to justify some of our beliefs’ when adopting the deontic view. A sound egalitarianism should incorporate teleological and deontic aspects.

b. The Objection of Inhumanity

The objection of inhumanity, which had been brought into the discussion by Anderson (1999) is one of the main arguments against egalitarianism. Anderson’s version of the argument has three different parts, firstly, the ‘fault is-up-to-them’ objection (Anderson 1999: 295-302; also Barry 1991: 149 and MacLeod 1998: 75p.), secondly, the objection of stigmatizing (Anderson 1999: 302-307; also MacLeod 1998: 106-108), and thirdly, the tutelage objection (Anderson 1999: 310; also Hayek 1960: 85-102).

i. The Fault is-Up-to-Them Objection

The first part is an objection against the (supposed) egalitarian view that people who are responsible for their own terrible situation should be left alone with their problems, no matter what happens to them. The second part is an objection against the kind of reasons egalitarians have in order to help people who are in a terrible situation, which did not arise through their own fault. The third part is an objection against the decision-making of the state – in which category a misery should be placed – and the investigation of the citizens in order to get the relevant information for the state. This would be, in Anderson’s view, a case of putting the citizens under the tutelage of the state and harming their private sphere.

Proponents of luck egalitarianism want to equalize undeserved life prospects, the people should be responsible for their decisions, that means, strictly speaking, they have no justified demands for supply, if they get into a miserable situation on their own fault. Anderson criticises Rakowski’s view (1991), who states that it would be all right to let a guilty car driver die in a hospital, who has no insurance and illegally made a turn over on the street which causes a serious accident. The guilty car driver, so Rakowski, has no legal demands to be kept on the artificial respiration apparatus, any longer. Others argue that society should help people no matter whether they caused their own disaster or not, they are human beings and this is the best reason to give them a helping hand if they lost the right track. This may be seen as a true milestone of the development in human history. To be part of a “real” community means to help those needy people. What about the idea of humanity and charity, the idea to show compassion with members of ones own community, or with the conception of beneficence? To neglect helpless people seems inappropriate for a community which is devoted to the idea of human flourishing – the basic concept of each sound community.

People who lived a jet-set life should not have a (legal) demand to live such a life again, if they caused a disaster and lost everything and the only way to be better off again would be to let society pay for it. This demand seems unsound but they should live a human being worthy life and society has to pay for it, no matter what the price is. And this account does not contradict with a sophisticated version of a pluralistic egalitarianism. On this point, Anderson cites Arneson who thinks that it might be unfair to make people responsible for their actions in all circumstances since responsible decisions are dependent on necessary capacities – foresight, steadfastness, ability to calculate, strong will, self-confidence – which are partly due to one’s genes or the luck to have good parents. Therefore, those people have a demand on a special paternalistic protection by society with regard to their own bad decisions. Arneson thinks that this could be financed by an obligatory social contribution of the people to a pension scheme. Others, so Anderson, hold the view that a strict compensation of welfare should also be modified by paternalistic intervention. That means only paternalistic reasons could make social contributions obligatory and could justify the distribution of a monthly guaranteed income. Anderson disputes the fact that luck egalitarians show the necessary respect for citizens since they state that people, who had hard luck by virtue of their own fault, ‘earn’ it. She seems to be on the wrong path when she criticises other egalitarians who want to help the badly off people by social insurances on paternalistic reasons. These paternalistic reasons – in order to justify obligatory social insurances – are, in her opinion, a sign of taking citizens to be silly and to be unable to organise their own lives. It is hard to see, so Anderson, how one can expect from citizens not to lose their self-esteem by accepting this kind of justification.

Amy Gutmann criticises Anderson on two points, firstly, she states that even egalitarians should be able to argue that there are special cases – like the guilty car driver case – which are so badly that these people should be helped, even if they got into the miserable situation on their own fault. Secondly, paternalism could be an honourable and compelling principle of legislation. Hence, it must not be humiliating for the state to make laws, for instance, on wearing safety belts, insofar the laws are due to a democratic process. Although Anderson shares the intention of these arguments, she states on the first point that the very idea to guarantee special kind of goods would contradict with the spirit of luck egalitarianism. It might be that this line of argument speaks against luck egalitarianism but not against a sophisticated version of a pluralistic egalitarianism. The safety belt case, so Anderson, is not a good example for restricting the citizen’s liberty with regard to cases in which their liberty is restricted to a great amount, like in cases of coercive partaking of social insurances. The society’s justification should be much stronger than the claim that society knows the citizen’s interests better than they do. There should be no problem for citizens to take part in a social insurance when it is reasonable for them. Under the ‘veil of ignorance,’ to take up Rawl’s famous thought-experiment, everybody would agree on a social insurance if the advantages, for instance not to die in a hospital by virtue of having no insurance at all, rule out the disadvantage of coercive partaking. It seems right that just a few people would like to live in a society where people have to die, because they have not got a social insurance, for whatever reasons. And, if the price for it is to take part in a social insurance, even if it is a liability, one should not hesitate to do so. But, if a person decided not to take part and she is the guilty car driver, she should be helped, no matter what the costs are. This is due to human dignity and there is no sound counterargument why pluralistic egalitarians should not be able to integrate this idea in their conception without losing their track. There is, of course, a practical necessity for every society not to pay for everyone; the social insurances of the state could only finance a limited number of people who do not have – for whatever reasons – a social insurance. Hence, it should be in everybody’s interest, in order to relieve society of high extra costs, to pay for one’s own social insurance. Therefore, it is in society’s interest – and this means in the end in the interest of everybody – to force the people by law to have their own social insurances. In this case, nothing speaks against being forced to one’s own luck.

ii. The Objection of Stigmatizing

The objection of stigmatizing is an objection against the kind of reasons egalitarians have in order to help people who are in terrible situations, which did not arise through their own fault (‘bad brute luck’), for instance, disabled people from birth, or people who became disabled by virtue of an illness or an accident, or people with (very) poor natural talents, and so forth. Anderson thinks, firstly, that there is no care for all badly off people, if one looks at the rules, which lay down who belongs to the ‘bad brute luck’ people, and secondly, the reasons to help the ‘bad brute luck’ people are discriminating for them. The reasons offered to distribute extra resources to handicapped people, so Anderson on the egalitarian view, are wrong because ‘[p]eople lay claim to the resources of egalitarian redistribution in virtue of their inferiority to others, not in virtue of their equality to others’ (Anderson 1999: 306). The principles of distribution are based on pity, which is in her view incompatible with the respect for human dignity. Her main question is, whether a theory of justice, which is based on contemptuous pity for the alleged beneficiaries, could serve egalitarian standards, that equal respect of each human being is the basis of justice. She comes to the conclusion that luck egalitarianism disregards the basic requirements, which every sound egalitarian theory should have.

One might argue that the concern of the ‘equality of fortune’-theorists is based on humanitarian compassion and not on contemptuous pity, but even than, so Anderson, one has to keep the distinctions between the two notions in mind: ‘Compassion is based on an awareness of suffering, an intrinsic condition of a person. Pity, by contrast, is aroused by a comparison of the observer’s condition with the condition of the object of pity’ (Anderson 1999: 306p.). In Anderson’s view, ‘compassion’ says that the person in question is badly off and ‘pity’ says that the person in question is worse off than oneself (‘she is sadly inferior to me’). Both can move one to help others, who are in need, ‘but only pity is condescending.’ But, even for the sake of argument, to take ‘humanitarian compassion’ as a starting point, this would be no sound basis for egalitarian principles of distribution, because compassion aims at relieving suffering and not equalizing it. She states, according to Raz (1986: 242), that once people are relieved of their suffering and neediness, compassion could not generate a further need of an equality of condition. The equality of fortune does not express compassion, it is not about the absolute misery of the person in question, it is about the gap between the best off and the worse off people. The better off people – who are guided by the considerations of luck egalitarianism – have a certain kind of feeling of superiority towards people, who are in need and, vice versa, the badly off people are envious and seek for an equal distribution of resources. Their criterion is an envy-free distribution (Anderson 1999: 306p.).

This may have some plausibility on the first sight, but a second glance shows that she mixed up two aspects, which should be sharply divided, the ‘factum’ of equality and the feeling of inferiority. In detail, her claim that pity is incompatible with human dignity is unsound and the only reason why this claim seems to be justified is that her notion of ‘pity’ is of a certain kind. Anderson’s definition of pity rests on her assumption that ‘pity’ is something that is due to a comparison between the conditions of the people involved and the feeling of those people, who help others who are in need, but, there is no necessity that those, who help others who are in need, have a certain kind of feeling, like, ‘she is really inferior to me’. It might be that some people feel like that, but most people would refuse this kind of talk. They would say that one has to help others who are in need because they are human beings, equal to me, and they did not deserve it to be left alone with their handicap. If one were one of them – one might argue – one would not like to be left alone, either. Anderson’s special definition is incompatible with human dignity, but there are other definitions. But even, so Anderson, if one agrees on humanitarian compassion as starting point for an egalitarian distribution, it would not be enough, since ‘compassion’ aims to ‘relieve suffering’ and not to ‘equalize’ it. According to the compassion view there is no ‘moral judgment on those who suffer’ (Anderson 1999: 307) and there is no further distribution in sight if the suffering of the people has been relieved. This is no objection against the compassion view at all. Firstly, there is no necessity to have a certain kind of feeling, like, ‘she is really inferior to me,’ and secondly, if disabled people are cured, there is no further reason to give them extra resources. They are in a good healthy condition again. Anderson’s main point is that luck egalitarianism claim that disabled people get extra resources by virtue of their inferiority and not by virtue of their equality to other people. One has to differentiate between i.) the improper special feeling of certain kind of people, who help others who are in need (‘she is really inferior to me’) and their motivation to help the needy people, and ii.) the ‘true’ reason why, for instance, disabled people should be treated equally and differently at the same time. Differently, because they get extra resources according to proportional equality, and equally, because they are human beings and should be treated morally equal, according to arithmetical equality. All versions of egalitarianism have one main aspect in common and it may be that Anderson overlooks this important aspect in her talk about what the reasons are to help people who are in need.

iii. The Tutelage Objection

The tutelage objection is against the decision-making of the state – in which category a misery should be placed – and the investigation of the citizens in order to get the relevant information for the state’s decision. This would be, in Anderson’s view, a case of putting the citizens under the tutelage of the state and harming their private sphere (Anderson 1999: 310; also Hayek 1960: 85-102). ‘Equality of fortune,’ so Anderson, says ‘that no one should suffer from undeserved misfortune’ (Anderson 1999: 310). But, in order to determine which people are allowed to get special treatment (res. extra resources) the state must make judgments on the people’s moral responsibility concerning their situation to brute or option luck. In citing Hayek (1960: 95-97) who states that ‘(…) in order to lay a claim to some important benefit, people are forced to obey other people’s judgments of what uses they should have made of their opportunities, rather than following their own judgments’ (Anderson 1999: 310) Anderson concludes that such a system would require the state to make ‘grossly intrusive, moralizing judgments of individual’s choices’ (Anderson 1999: 310). Hence, equality of fortune contradicts with citizen’s privacy and liberty. This is in Korsgaard’s view (1993: 61), on which Anderson is affirmatively referring to, a disrespectful behaviour of the state: ‘But it is disrespectful for the state to pass judgment on how much people are responsible for their expensive tastes or their imprudent choices’ (Anderson 1999: 310).

Her objection against the function of the state to decide which people are morally responsible for their situation according to brute or option luck seems plausible. For the sake of argument, let everybody agree on the point to help people, who suffer from undeserved misfortune. The very question is, then, how the state could organise a system, which treats everyone fairly and with respect. It is a practical necessity that the state decides which people get extra resources financed by the social community. And, it should be no problem to say that, if the state is spending public money, someone has to prove the legitimacy of requests. Therefore, the state needs information and this has nothing to do with harming the people’s liberty or private sphere. It is a hard thing to decide how far this gathering of information by the state should go, of course, no one would like to live in a state where Big Brother is watching you all the time, but one must acknowledge the simple fact that the state has to take precautions not to be deceived by social cheaters. If a person wants public money, she should better have a sound reason, if not, she might be a cheater. It is not about ‘expensive tastes’ or ‘imprudent choices’ (Korsgaard 1993), rather it is about the question if one suffers from undeserved misfortune or not. Anderson is right in stating that there are cases, which could be very complex and, for this reason, might ‘undermine’ the system of distribution. Life is not simple and one has also to cope with those extreme cases. But this special problem always appears according to penumbra cases, the only way out is trying to make well-informed decisions. Not to distribute extra resources to people, who are in need by virtue of undeserved misfortune, might be the wrong decision.

c. The Objection of Complexity

The objection of complexity, which had been brought into the discussion by Lucas (1965, 1977) and Rescher (1966), could also be found in the first chapter of Walzer’s book ‘Spheres of Justice. A Defence of Pluralism and Equality’ (1983: 3-30). His criticism is powerful and illuminating. The main point against egalitarianism is his assumption that the ‘spheres of justice’ are much more complicated than egalitarians believe. Their assumption that equality is the only – or most important – aim (res. principle) of justice is a false monism. There are, according to the prioritarians, other principles of distribution like the principle of merit or desert, the principle of efficiency, or the principle of qualification, and so forth. Nearly every sphere of conduct has special principles of distribution.

Not ‘all’ egalitarians pursue an improper account of egalitarianism. A sophisticated account of pluralistic egalitarianism is much more harder to attack as a simple travesty. Walzer’s ‘relevant reasons approach’ (or theory of ‘complex equality’) is very suitable with regard to different spheres of justice because his account considers special circumstances of the subjects in question. The main difference between his account and luck egalitarianism is, according to the ‘relevant reasons approach,’ that equality is only a by-product of the fulfilment of complex standards of justice and not the aim of justice. There seems to be no strong argument to support the extreme view, that egalitarianism is bound to the assumption that equality is the only aim of justice and not also a by-product; it just had been taken for granted since Feinberg’s famous paper ‘Noncomparative Justice’ (1974, for a critical discussion on Feinberg’s account, see Kane 1996: 380pp.). The objection of complexity tells us that there is no possibility for egalitarians to use different kinds of principles of distribution without losing their egalitarian track (e.g. Krebs 2000: 28p.). This assumption seems to be wrong. Firstly, pluralistic egalitarians are not bound to one principle, only; they could also integrate other principles like the principle of autonomy, the principle of liberty and so on without betraying themselves. Secondly, the idea of equality is not restricted to a simple version of result equality (Gosepath 2003: 276), rather to a sophisticated version of proportional equality, which covers different kinds of principles. Hence, there seems to be a close connection to Walzer’s theory of ‘complex equality,’ although one would rather say that his theory is a non-egalitarian account.

4. Two Egalitarian Arguments

One of the main arguments with regard to the egalitarian view is the presumption of equality argument (Berlin 1955/56; Tugendhat 1997; Gosepath 2001) and the argument of pluralistic egalitarianism (Gordon 2006).

a. The Egalitarians’ Assumption of the Presumption of Equality

What about the egalitarians’ assumption of ‘the presumption of equality’? Isaiah Berlin stated in his famous paper ‘Equality as an Ideal’ (1955/56) that equality does not need any justification, but only inequality does. He gives the following example to make his assumption plausible: If someone has a cake and there are 10 people to be taken into account, than, there is no need of justification, automatically, if every person is getting a tenth part. But, if the distributor is not acting according to the principle of equal distribution, he has to give some special reasons for his decision.

Even if common sense justifies Berlin’s ‘argument,’ one has to take into account that the equal distribution – in the example given by Berlin – has no moral advantage with regard to the unequal distribution. Although Frankfurt hold the same view as Berlin does – that the cake should be divided into ten equal parts – he gives a different justification concerning this distribution. The important point is, so Frankfurt, that the distributor in this example has no special reasons to divide the cake in equal parts nor to divide the cake in unequal parts. In one word, he does not know, whether the people should be treated equally concerning a special respect, which could justify an equal distribution, or vice versa. The distributor has no relevant information at all. There are just few philosophers who give reasons why equality needs no justification, others – as Berlin does – take it for granted and/or call for common sense or intuitions. The famous German philosopher Ernst Tugendhat (1997) claims that only inequality needs special reasons. According to Tugendhat, egalitarianism in the strict sense is not about material equal distribution, but about the simple fact that all people have equal moral rights (5), albeit their empirical differences (10). Prioritarians think that there are good reasons to restrict equality (14). Egalitarianism and prioritarianism are not on the same level, since egalitarians – unlike prioritarians – claim for a special proposition. Prioritarians, so Tugendhat, are not bound to a special proposition; their accounts are unlimited concerning the variety of different ‘Konfigurationen,’ (that is the description of duties and rights of a certain moral community, Tugendhat 1997: 5) and hence, prioritarianism claims not for a certain proposition (11). This is the background, according to Tugendhat, for having the justified believe that there is a certain presumption of equality with regard to inequality in the moral realm, albeit this presumption is very ‘thin,’ but it doubtlessly exists (11). In more detail: Regarding an unequal distribution one gives always some reasons why the distribution should not be equal; one is not able to do so concerning an equal distribution (13, 14). If one accepts Tugendhat’s assumption that the primacy of equality is, lastly, due to the structure of moral justification - according to Tugendhat (1997), ‘moral justification’ means that it is an equal justification with respect to all people. The only case of a legitimate justification of inequality is the case, which could be justified with regard to all people (18). Every just distribution has to be equal, unless one is able to justify the reasons concerning the unequal distribution to all people (19) - and not due to a false understanding of an apriori or a dark notion of reason, one might come to the conclusion that his explication is sound. Of course, there are other accounts of philosophers (e.g. Kant’s kingdom of ends, Bentham’s all count as one, Gewirth’s principle of generic consistency, or Boylan’s argument for the moral rights of basic goods), but Tugendhat’s account is by virtue of several reasons particularly interesting and illuminating: firstly, he states that egalitarianism is about moral rights in the strict sense of the notion, secondly, he argues that egalitarianism and prioritarianism are not on the same level, and thirdly, he holds the assumption that the primacy of equality is due to the structure of moral justification.

b. Pluralistic Egalitarianism

The extreme ‘egalitarian’ view that equality – in the special sense of comparative equality – is the only aim of justice is wrong, but the other extreme ‘prioritarian’ view that equality has nothing to do with justice is also wrong. The truth is somewhere in-between. There are, at least, four different aspects, which show that justice and equality are (closely) connected with each other: Firstly, according to prioritarians equality is important as a by-product for the fulfilment of absolute standards, for instance, human dignity. Secondly, relational (res. comparative) equality is one aspect of justice among others; one need relational equality in order to yield e.g. legal equality, equality of chances, or antidiscrimination laws. Thirdly, equality is indispensable in being a joint starting point with regard to political autonomy, social membership, or liberty of exchange because absolute standards presuppose that people’s life prospects are more or less the same. Fourthly, equality is (also) a result of political autonomy insofar as there seem to exist special cases according to which an equal distribution is rightly demanded (e.g. the Norwegian public oil reserves).

It seems that the opposition between philosophers who are egalitarians and philosophers who are prioritarians according to Miller (1990) is a false one, and better be ‘understood as a debate about whether one particular kind of equality – economic equality, say – should be pursued or not’ (Miller 1997: 222). He may be right in stating that ‘there are two different kinds of valuable equality, one connected with justice, and the other standing independently’ (Miller 1997: 224). He suggests a so-called third way: ‘Equality of the first kind is distributive in nature. It specifies that benefits of a certain kind – rights, for instance – should be distributed equally, because justice requires this. The second kind of equality is not in this sense distributive. It does not specify directly any distribution of rights or resources. Instead it identifies a social ideal, the ideal of a society in which people regard and treat one another as equals, in other words a society that is not marked by status divisions such that one can place different people in hierarchically ranked categories, in different classes for instance. We can call this second kind of equality equality of status, or simply social equality.’ (Miller 1997: 224). Miller seems right in saying that the two different notions of equality are not closely enough separated in the debate. According to Nagel (1979: chapter 3-6) everybody think that moral equality – or mutatis mutandis ‘social equality’ in Miller’s words – is something all people acknowledge, but the crux is that the interpretations diverge, for instance, with regard to utilitarians (chapter 4), the position of individual rights (chapter 5), and egalitarians (chapter 6). A plausible social ethics, so Nagel, would be influenced by all three accounts (chapter 7). Miller’s assumption that social equality is something that is not part of justice seems premature. Tugendhat seems right in stating that egalitarianism in the strict sense is about moral rights, hence, social equality as such is one part of justice. If one restricts a person’s moral rights, one better give sound reasons why one does not treat her equally according to others, if one is not able to give a plain justification, one treats her unjustly. This has nothing to do with any kind of distributions, although Miller seems to hold the claim that moral rights could also be distributed. Some egalitarians cite Aristotle’s famous propositions that, firstly, it is just that equal people get equal shares and unequal people get unequal shares, and secondly, it is unjust that equal people get unequal shares and unequal people get equal shares (EN V, 6) to back up their main hypothesis that the presumption of equality follows directly from Aristotle’s account of formal equality. It is apparent that they did not analyse the whole context of these propositions. The argument of ‘the presumption of equality’ should not be based on this passage. Instead, the passage could be turned against the prioritarian view that egalitarians are bound to a form of result equality.

‘And the same equality will exist between the persons and between the things concerned; for as the latter – the things concerned – are related, so are the former; if they are not equal, they will not have what is equal, but this is the origin of quarrels and complaints – when either equals have and are awarded unequal shares, or unequals equal shares. Further, this is plain from the fact that awards should be according to merit; for all men agree that what is just in distribution must be according to merit in some sense, though they do not all specify the same sort of merit, but democrats identify it with the status of freeman, supporters of oligarchy with wealth (or with noble birth), and supporters of aristocracy with excellence.’ (Aristotle EN V, 6 1131a20-1131a29)

Aristotle states that there is always trouble if unequals get equal shares, that means, if equals get unequal shares or unequals get equal shares. But, there is no claim in the cited passage, which says that all people should be treated equally (presumption of equality), rather all people should be treated equally according to a special axia, namely the political virtue. According to Aristotle’s account of justice in Book V of the Nicomachean Ethics one has to acknowledge the fact that the proposition ‘equals should get equal shares’ is due to the principle of proportional equality (distributional justice), and should not be seen under the heading of ‘justice in exchanges’ (Aristotle EN V, 5 1131a) – where the principle of arithmetical equality exists – which is about justice concerned with exchanges according to reciprocity (EN V, 8) and retributive justice (EN V, 7). To put it in a nutshell, the formal principle of equality – equals should get equal shares or in a different formula equal cases should be treated equally – is empty, and the prioritarians, on the one hand, are right in saying that egalitarians are wrong in their assumption that the presumption of equality is due to this formal principle. Aristotle’s approach to fill it is his account of proportional equality. On the other hand, there is hardly any sound argument – with respect to the debate between egalitarians and prioritarians – that would claim for the special proposition that egalitarians are restricted to ‘result equality,’ and not also to ‘proportional equality’ within a sophisticated version of pluralistic egalitarianism (e.g. Gosepath 2004). Some prioritarians forget the simple point that there are two ways of taking other people’s condition into account, firstly, by proportional equality, and secondly, by stipulating absolute standards of justice.

Equality as the only aim of justice or as a mere by-product of justice is an unhappy distinction to follow. Justice cannot be reduced to equality alone and the importance of equality is too great to be a mere appendage. The prioritarians are right in their criticism that it would be absurd to strive for equality for its own sake; but they forgot that hardly any sophisticated version of egalitarianism is doing so (or would do so). It seems unsound, when people hold the view that all human beings should be treated equally by virtue of the simple fact that the ideal of equality should be fulfilled for its own sake. Instead, the demand of treating people morally equal may give some hints for equal distributions in other spheres (see also Gosepath 2001). But, as Walzer nicely puts it, nearly each sphere needs its own standard, and therefore, it might be right not to choose between the egalitarian or prioritarian view but to combine both accounts. According to this, Gosepath (2001) suggests that proportional equality could be a good basis for a sound discussion between egalitarian and prioritarian theories of justice.

There is a close connection between justice and equality, firstly, a conceptual connection, and secondly, a normative connection. First, equality is a necessary condition for justice, since one is not able to give a full explication on the notion of justice without taking formal and proportional equality into account (see Aristotle EN V). The stipulation of absolute standards of justice, for instance human dignity, is something, which should be incorporated. But it should be clear that the stipulation of absolute standards is not enough, one should also take the egalitarian model into account. Second, in his famous example of a ruler who fries his subjects in oil and, afterwards, also fries himself Frankena (1962: 1 and 17) is stating that the ruler acts immorally but not against the ideal of equality. This is the reason why formal and proportional justices form a necessary but not a sufficient condition. The normative connection between justice and equality tries to solve this problem and acts as a shield against such and alike cases by providing a standard of normative constraints (e.g. human rights).

5. Reference and Further Reading

  • Anderson, E. (1999): "What is the Point of Equality?," in: Ethics, Vol. 109, 287-337.
  • Aristoteles (1990): Ethica Nicomachea, Bywater, I. (Ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Aristotle (1995): Nicomachean Ethics, Ross, W. D./ Urmson, J. O. (trans.), in: Barnes, J. (Ed.): The Complete Works of Aristotle, Vol. II., Princeton: University Press.
  • Arneson, R. (1989): "Equality and Equal Opportunity for Welfare," in: Philosophical Studies, Vol. 56, 77-93.
  • Arneson, R. (2000): "Luck Egalitarianism and Prioritarianism," in: Ethics, Vol. 110, 339-349.
  • Barry, B. (1991): Liberty and Justice, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Bentham, J. (1996): "An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation," in: Burns, J.H., Hart, H.L.A. (Ed.): The Collected Works of Jeremy Bentham, New York: Oxford University Press.
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Author Information

John-Stewart Gordon
Ruhr-University Bochum

Thomas Aquinas: Political Philosophy

aquinasThe political philosophy of Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274), along with the broader philosophical teaching of which it is part, stands at the crossroads between the Christian gospel and the Aristotelian political doctrine that was, in Aquinas' time, newly discovered in the Western world. In fact, Aquinas' whole developed system is often understood to be simply a modification of Aristotelian philosophy in light of the Christian gospel and with special emphasis upon those questions most relevant to Christianity, such as the nature of the divine, the human soul, and morality. This generalization would explain why Aquinas seems to eschew, even neglect, the subject of politics. Unlike his medieval Jewish and Islamic counterparts, Aquinas does not have to reconcile Aristotelianism with a concrete political and legal code specified in the sacred writings of his religion. As far as he is concerned, God no longer requires people to live according to the judicial precepts of the Old Law (Summa Theologiae [hereafter ST], I-II, 104.3), and so the question of formulating a comprehensive Christian political teaching that is faithful to biblical principles loses it urgency if not its very possibility. Unlike Judaism and Islam, Christianity does not involve specific requirements for conducting civil society. In fact, most Christians before Aquinas' time (such as St. Augustine) had interpreted Jesus' assertion that we should "render unto Caesar the things that are Caesar's" (Matthew22:21) to mean that Christianity can flourish in any political regime so long as its authorities permit believers to "render unto God the things that are God's." Although Jesus claimed to be a king, he was quick to add that his kingdom was not of this world (John 18:36), and whereas St. Paul had exhorted Christians to obey the civil authorities and even to suffer injustice willingly, he never considered it necessary to discuss the nature of political justice itself.

These observations perhaps explain why Aquinas, whose writings nearly all come in the form of extremely well organized and systematic treatises, never completed a thematic discussion of politics. His letter On Kingship (written as a favor to the king of Cyprus) comes closest to fitting the description of a political treatise, and yet this brief and unfinished work hardly presents a comprehensive treatment of political philosophy. Even his commentary on Aristotle's Politics is less than half complete, and it is debatable whether this work is even intended to express Aquinas' own political philosophy at all. This does not mean, however, that Aquinas was uninterested in political philosophy or that he simply relied on Aristotle to provide the missing political teaching that Christianity leaves out. Nor does it mean that Aquinas does not have a political teaching. Although it is not expressed in overtly political works, Aquinas' thoughts on political philosophy may be found within treatises that contain discussions of issues with far reaching political implications. In his celebrated Summa Theologiae, for instance, Aquinas engages in long discussions of law, the virtue of justice, the common good, economics, and the basis of morality. Even though not presented in the context of a comprehensive political teaching, these texts provide a crucial insight into Aquinas' understanding of politics and the place of political philosophy within his thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Natural Law
  2. The Political Nature of Man
  3. Human Legislation
  4. The Requirements of Justice
  5. The Limitations of Politics
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
      1. Aquinas' Political Writings in English
      2. Two Useful Collections of Aquinas' Political Writings in English
    2. Secondary Sources
      1. Books
      2. Articles and Chapters

1. Natural Law

Aquinas' celebrated doctrine of natural law no doubt plays a central role in his moral and political teaching. According to Aquinas, everything in the terrestrial world is created by God and endowed with a certain nature that defines what each sort of being is in its essence. A thing's nature is detectable not only in its external appearance, but also and more importantly through the natural inclinations which guide it to behave in conformity with the particular nature it has. As Aquinas argues, God's authorship and active role in prescribing and sustaining the various natures included in creation may rightfully be called a law. After defining law as "an ordinance of reason for the common good, made by someone who has care of the community, and promulgated." (ST, I-II, 90.4), Aquinas explains that the entire universe is governed by the supreme lawgiver par excellence: "Granted that the world is ruled by Divine Providence...the whole community of the universe is governed by Divine Reason." (ST, I-II, 91.1). Even though the world governed by God's providence is temporal and limited, Aquinas calls the law that governs it the "eternal law." Its eternal nature comes not from that to which it applies, but rather from whom the law is derived, namely, God. As Aquinas explains, "the very idea of the government of things in God the Ruler of the universe, has the nature of a law. And since Divine Reason's conception of things is not subject to time but is eternal, according to Prov. viii, 23...this kind of law must be called eternal." (Ibid.).

In the vast majority of cases, God governs his subjects through the eternal law without any possibility that that law might be disobeyed. This, of course, is because most beings in the universe (or at least in the natural world) do not possess the rational ability to act consciously in a way that is contrary to the eternal law implanted in them. Completely unique among natural things, however, are humans who, although completely subject to divine providence and the eternal law, possess the power of free choice and therefore have a radically different relation to that law. As Aquinas explains, "among all others, the rational creature is subject to Divine Providence in the most excellent way, in so far as it partakes of a share of providence, by being provident both for itself, and for others. Wherefore, it has a share of the Eternal Reason, whereby it has a natural inclination to its proper act and end." (ST, I-II, 91.2). Because the rational creature's relation to the eternal law is so different from that of any other created thing, Aquinas prefers to call the law that governs it by a different name. Instead of saying that humans are under the eternal law, therefore, he says they are under the natural law, and yet "the natural law is nothing else than the rational creature's participation of the eternal law" (Ibid.). Another, equally accurate, way of stating Aquinas' position is that the natural law is the eternal law as it applies to human beings.

As the "rule and measure" of human behavior, the natural law provides the only possible basis for morality and politics. Simply stated, the natural law guides human beings through their fundamental inclinations toward the natural perfection that God, the author of the natural law, intends for them. As we have seen, however, the human subjugation to the eternal law (called the natural law) is always concomitant with a certain awareness the human subject has of the law binding him. This awareness is crucial in Aquinas' view. Since one of the essential components of law is to be promulgated, the natural law would lose its legal character if human beings did not have the principles of that law instilled in their minds (ST, I-II, 90.4 ad 1). For this reason Aquinas considers the natural law to be a habit, not in itself, but because the principles (or precepts) of the natural law are naturally held in our minds by means of an intellectual habit, which Aquinas calls synderesisSynderisis denotes a natural knowledge held by all people instructing them as to the fundamental moral requirements of their human nature. As Aquinas explains, just as speculative knowledge requires there to be certain principles from which one can draw further conclusions, so also practical and moral knowledge presupposes an understanding of fundamental practical precepts from which more concrete moral directives may be derived. Whereas Aquinas calls the habit by which human beings understand the first moral principles (which are also the first principles of the natural law) synderesis (ST, Ia, 79.12), he calls the act by which one applies that understanding to concrete situations conscience (ST, Ia, 79.13). Therefore, by means of synderesis a man would know that the act of adultery is morally wrong and contrary to the natural law. By an act of conscience he would reason that intercourse with this particular woman that is not his wife is an act of adultery and should therefore be avoided. Thus understood, the natural law includes principles that are universally accessible regardless of time, place, or culture. In Aquinas' words, it is the same in all humans (ST, I-II, 94.4), unchangeable (ST, I-II, 94.5), and cannot be abolished from the hearts of men (ST, I-II, 94.6). It is in light of this teaching that Aquinas interprets St. Paul's argument that the "Gentiles who have not the law do by nature what the law requires, they are a law to themselves, even though they do not have the law. They show that what the law requires is written on their hearts." (Romans 2:14-16).

How are the precepts of the natural law derived? According to Aquinas, the very first precept is that "good is to be done and pursued and evil is to be avoided." (ST, I-II, 94.2). As he explains, this principle serves the practical reason just as the principle of non-contradiction serves the speculative reason. Just as the speculative intellect naturally apprehends the fact that "the same thing cannot be affirmed and denied at the same time," the practical intellect apprehends that good is to be pursued and evil is to be avoided. By definition, neither the first principle of speculative nor practical reason can be demonstrated. Rather, they are principles without which human reasoning cannot coherently draw any conclusions whatsoever. Otherwise stated, they are first principles inasmuch as they are not derived from any prior practical or speculative knowledge. Still, they are just as surely known as any other knowledge obtained through demonstrative reasoning. In fact, they are naturally known and self-evident for the very same reason that they are not subject to demonstration. This is important from Aquinas' perspective because all practical knowledge (including the moral and political sciences) must rest upon certain principles before any valid conclusions are drawn. To return to the above example, a man who recognizes the evil of adultery will only know that this act of adultery must be avoided if he first understands the more fundamental precept that evil ought to be avoided in general. No one can prove this general principle to him. He simply understands it by the habit of synderesis.

Aquinas would be the first to recognize, of course, that the simple requirements of doing good and avoiding evil fail to provide human beings with much content for pursuing the moral life. How, one must ask, do we know what things actually are good and evil? In response to this Aquinas argues that human beings must consult their natural inclinations. Beyond the mere knowledge that good is to be pursued and evil avoided our natural inclinations are the most fundamental guide to understanding where the natural law is directing us. In other words, our natural inclinations reveal to us what the most fundamental human goods are. As Aquinas explains, man first has natural inclinations "in accordance with the nature he has in common with all substances...such as preserving human life and warding off its obstacles." Secondly, there are inclinations we have in common with other animals, such as "sexual intercourse," the "education of offspring and so forth." And finally there are inclinations specific to man's rational nature, such as the inclination to "know the truth about God," to "shun ignorance," and to "live in society." (Ibid.). It may seem strange that Aquinas would list the pursuit of "sexual intercourse" as one of the natural inclinations supporting and defining the natural law. To be sure, Aquinas recognizes that all the aforementioned inclinations are subject to the corruption of our sinful nature. It is not morally good, therefore, simply to act on an inclination. One must first recognize the natural purpose of a given inclination and only act upon it insofar as that purpose is respected. This is why Aquinas is quick to add that all inclinations belong to the natural law only insofar as they are "ruled by reason." (ST, I-II, 94.2, ad 2). As someone is inclined to sexual intercourse, for instance, he must also recognize that this natural good must be pursued only within a certain context (that is, within marriage, open to the possibility of procreation, etc.). If this natural order of reason is ignored, any natural good (even knowledge [ST, II-II, 167]) can be pursued in an inappropriate way that is actually contrary to the natural law.

2. The Political Nature of Man

As we have seen, Aquinas mentions that one of the natural goods to which human beings are inclined is "to live in society." This remark presents the ideal point of departure for one of the most important teachings of Thomistic political philosophy, namely, the political nature of man. This doctrine is taken primarily from the first book of Aristotle's Politics upon which Aquinas wrote an extensive commentary (although the commentary is only completed through book 3, chapter 8 of Aristotle's Politics, Aquinas seems to have commented upon what he considered to be the Politics' theoretical core.). Following "the Philosopher" Aquinas believes that political society (civitas) emerges from the needs and aspirations of human nature itself. Thus understood, it is not an invention of human ingenuity (as in the political teachings of modern social contract theorists) nor an artificial construction designed to make up for human nature's shortcomings. It is, rather, a prompting of nature itself that sets humans apart from all other natural creatures. To be sure, political society is not simply given by nature. It is rather something to which human beings naturally aspire and which is necessary for the full perfection of their existence. The capacity for political society is not natural to man, therefore, in the same way as the five senses are natural. The naturalness of politics is more appropriately compared to the naturalness of moral virtue (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lesson 1 [40]). Even though human beings are inclined to moral virtue, acquiring the virtues nonetheless requires both education and habituation. In the same way, even though human beings are inclined to live in political societies, such societies must still be established, built, and maintained by human industry. To be fully human is to live in political society, and Aquinas makes a great deal of Aristotle's claim that one who is separated from society so as to be completely a-political must be either sub-human or super-human, either a "beast or a god." (Aristotle's Politics, 1253a27; Cf. Aquinas'Commentary, Book 1, Lesson 1 [39]).

Aquinas admits, of course, that political society is not the only natural community. The family is natural in perhaps an even stronger sense and is prior to political society. The priority of the family, however, is not a priority of importance, since politics aims at a higher and nobler good than the family. It is rather a priority of development. In other words, politics surpasses all other communities in dignity while at the same time depending upon and presupposing the family. On this point Aquinas follows Aristotle's explanation of how political society develops from other lower societies including both the family and the village. The human family comes into existence from the nearly universal tendency of males and females joining together for purposes of procreation. Humans share with other animals (and even plants) a "natural appetite to leave after them another being like themselves," (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lesson 1 [18]) and immediately see the utility if not the necessity of both parents remaining available to provide for the needs of the children and one another. As families grow in size and number there also seems to be a tendency for them to gravitate towards one another and form villages. The reasons for this are primarily utilitarian. Whereas the household suffices for providing the daily necessities of life, the village is necessary for providing non-daily commodities (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lesson 1 [27]). What Aquinas and Aristotle seem to have in mind in describing the emergence of the village is the division of labor. Whereas humans can reproduce and survive quite easily in families, life becomes much more productive and affluent when families come together in villages, since one man can now specialize in a certain task while fulfilling his family's remaining material needs through barter and trade.

Despite the village's usefulness to man, it nevertheless leaves him incomplete. This is partly because the village is still relatively small and so the effectiveness of the division of labor remains limited. Much more useful is the conglomeration of several villages, which provides a wider variety of commodities and specializations to be shared by means of exchange (Commentary on the Politics Book 1, Lesson 1 [31]). This is one reason why the village is eclipsed by political society, which proves much more useful to human beings because of its greater size and much more elaborate governmental structure. There is, however, a far more important reason why political society comes into existence. In addition to yielding greater protection and economic benefits, it also enhances the moral and intellectual lives of human beings. By identifying with a political community, human beings begin to see the world in broader terms than the mere satisfaction of their bodily desires and physical needs. Whereas the residents of the village better serve their individual interests, the goal of the political community becomes the good of the whole, or the common good, which Aquinas claims (following Aristotle) is "better and more divine than the good of the individual." (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lesson 1 [11]). The political community is thus understood as the first community (larger than the family) for which the individual makes great sacrifices, since it is not merely a larger cooperative venture for mutual economic benefit. It is, rather, the social setting in which man truly finds his highest natural fulfillment. In this sense, the political community, even though not directed to the individual good, better serves the individual by promoting a life of virtue in which human existence can be greatly ennobled. It is in this context that Aquinas argues (again following Aristotle) that although political society originally comes into being for the sake of living, it exists for the sake of "living well." (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lesson 1 [31]).

Aquinas takes Aristotle's argument that political society transcends the village and completes human social existence to prove that the city is natural. Similar, but not identical, to this claim is Aquinas' further assertion that man is by nature a "civic and social animal." (ST, I-II, 72.4). To support this, Aquinas refers us to Aristotle's observation that human beings are the only animals possessing the ability to exercise speech. Not to be confused with mere voice (vox), speech (loquutio) involves the communication of thoughts and concepts between persons (ST, I-II, 72.4). Whereas voice is found in many different animals that communicate their immediate desires and aversions to one another (seen in the dog's bark and the lion's roar) speech includes a conscious conception of what one is saying (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lecture 1 [36]). By means of speech, therefore, human beings may collectively deliberate on core civic matters regarding "what is useful and what is harmful," as well as "the just and the unjust." (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lecture 1 [37]). Whereas other animals exhibit a certain social tendency (as bees instinctively work to preserve their hive), only humans are social in the sense that they cooperate through speech to pursue a common understanding of justice, virtue, and the good. Since speech is the outward expression of his inner rationality, man is political by nature for the same reason he is naturally rational.

The fact that man is a naturally political animal has far-reaching implications. In addition to being a father, a mother, a farmer, or a teacher, a human being is more importantly identified as a citizen. Achieving genuine human excellence, therefore, most always means achieving excellence as a citizen of some political society (Aquinas does mention the possibility that someone's supernatural calling may necessitate that they live outside of political society. As examples of such people, he mentions "John the Baptist and Blessed Anthony the hermit." See his Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lecture 1 [35].). To be sure, the requirements of good citizenship vary from regime to regime, but more generally conceived the good citizen is the one that places the common good above his own private good and acts accordingly. In doing so, such a person exhibits the virtue of legal justice whereby all of his actions are referred in one way or another to the common good of his particular society (ST, II-II, 58.5). Following the progression of Aristotle's discussion of citizenship, however, Aquinas recognizes a certain difficulty in assigning an unqualifiedly high value to citizenship. What sense does it make to speak of a good citizen in a bad regime? One does not need to consider the worst sorts of regimes to see the difficulty inherent in achieving good citizenship. In any regime that is less than perfect there always remains the possibility that promoting the interests of the regime and promoting the common good may not be the same. To be sure, good men are often called to stand up heroically against tyrants (ST, II-II, 42.2, ad 3), but the full potential of the good citizen will never be realized unless he lives in best of all possible regimes. In other words, only in the best regime do the good citizen and the good human being coincide (Commentary on the Politics, Book 3, Lecture 3 [366]). In fact, even the best regime will fall short of producing a multitude of good citizens, since no society exists where everyone is virtuous (Commentary on the Politics, Book 3, Lecture 3 [367]).

But what is the best regime? Following Aristotle, Aquinas argues that all regimes can be divided into six basic types, which are determined according to two criteria: how the regime is ruled and whether or not it is ruled justly (that is, for the common good). As he explains, political rule may be exercised by the multitude, by a select few, or by one person. If the regime is ruled justly, it is called a monarchy or kingship when ruled by one single individual, an aristocracy when ruled by a few, and a polity or republic when ruled by the multitude. If, on the other hand, a regime is ruled unjustly (that is, for the sake of the ruler(s) and not for the common weal), it is called a tyranny when ruled by one, an oligarchy when ruled by a few, and a democracy when ruled by the multitude (On Kingship, Book 1, Chapter 1;Commentary on the Politics, Book 3, Lecture 6 [393-394]). Simply Stated, the best regime is monarchy. Aquinas' argument for this is drawn from a mixture of philosophical and theological observations. Inasmuch as the goal of any ruler should be the "unity of peace," the regime is better governed by one person rather than by many. For this end is much more efficaciously secured by a single wise authority who is not burdened by having to deliberate with others who may be less wise and who may stand in the way of effective governance. As Aquinas observes in his letter On Kingship, any governing body comprised of many must always strive to act as one in order to move the regime closer to the intended goal. In this sense, therefore, the less perfect regimes tend to imitate monarchy in which unanimity of rule is realized at once and without obstruction (On Kingship, Book 1, Chapter 2). This conclusion is confirmed by the example of nature, which always "does what is best." For the many powers of the human soul are governed by a single power, i.e., reason. A hive of bees is ruled by a single bee, i.e., the queen. And most convincingly of all, the universe is governed by the single authority of God, "Maker and Ruler of all things." As art is called to imitate nature, human society is therefore best that is governed by a single authority of a eminently wise and just monarch who resembles God as much as humanly possible.

Aquinas is well aware, of course, that such a monarch is not always available in political societies, and even where he is available it is not always guaranteed that the conditions will be right to grant him the political authority he ought to wield. Even worse, there is always the danger that the monarch will be corrupted and become a tyrant. In this case the best of all regimes has the greatest tendency to become the worst. This is why, whereas monarchy is the best regime simply speaking, it is not always the best regime in a particular time and place, which is to say it is certainly not always the best possible regime. Therefore, Aquinas outlines in the Summa Theologiae a more modest proposal whereby political rule is somewhat decentralized. The regime that he recommends takes the positive dimensions of all three "good regimes." Whereas it has a monarch at its head, it is also governed by "others" possessing a certain degree of authority who may advise the monarch while curbing any tyrannical tendencies he may have. Finally, Aquinas suggests that the entire multitude of citizens should be responsible for selecting the monarch and should all be candidates for political authority themselves. Whereas the best regime simply speaking is monarchy, the best possible regime seems to be the mixed government that incorporates the positive dimensions of monarchy, aristocracy, and democracy (In the Summa Theologiae, Aquinas appears to use the name of democracy in place of Aristotle's conception of polity.). To support this conclusion, Aquinas is able to cite the Hebrew form of government established by God in the Old Testament. Whereas Moses (and his successors) ruled the Jews as a monarch, there also existed a council of seventy-two elders which provided "an element of aristocracy." Inasmuch as the rulers were selected from among the people, this sacred regime of the Bible also incorporated a certain dimension of democracy (ST, I-II, 105.1).

3. Human Legislation

The fact that regimes may vary according to time and place is a perfect example of the fact that not every moral or political directive is specified by nature. In fact, Aquinas is eager to point out that the natural law, while providing the fundamental basis for human action and politics, fails to provide specific requirements for all the details of human social existence. For example, whereas the natural law does provide certain general standards of economic justice (which we shall consider later on), it does not give a preferred form of currency. There is no natural law that requires how often public roads should be repaired, or whether military service will be mandatory or voluntary. Whereas Aquinas argues that the natural law requires criminals to be punished for injustices such as murder, theft, and assault, there is no natural specification as to precisely what kinds of punishments ought to be imposed for these crimes. Even though, as Aquinas recognizes, these details do not pertain directly to whether a regime is good or bad, human social life would be impossible to maintain without attention to such detail. Such is the role, according to Aquinas, of human law (ST, I-II, 91.3).

This is not to suggest, of course, that human laws only concern those matters which may just as easily be decided one way or another. Within a particular socio-political context, it may indeed be a terrible mistake to make military service compulsory or in another context to punish treason with leniency, even though the natural law does not specify which situations call for which measures. Additionally, human law is necessary to enforce the moral and political requirements of the natural law that may go unheeded. Even though the precepts of the natural law are available to human reason when it considers matters rightly, not all human beings use their practical reason to its fullest capacity and some act maliciously even when they happen to know better. And because the natural law does not simply enforce itself, the basic requirements of justice must be bolstered by an organized and civilized human authority (ST, I-II, 95.1). Accordingly, human laws serve two purposes. First, they provide the missing details that the natural law leaves out due to its generality. Secondly, they compel those under the law to observe those standards of justice and morality even about which the natural law does specify. This second function of human law leads Aquinas to a crucial distinction. After asking whether human laws are derived from the natural law, he argues that, although all human laws are derived from the natural law in a certain sense, some are more directly derived than others. The distinction he invokes is that between human laws which constitute "conclusions" from principles of natural law and those which constitute "determinations" from the natural law. Human laws are considered conclusions from the natural law when they pertain to those matters about which the natural law offers a clear precept. To use Aquinas' own example, "that one must not kill may be derived as a conclusion from the principle that one should do harm to no man." (ST, I-II, 95.2). Thus, human laws must include prohibitions against murder, assault, and the like even though such actions are already prohibited by the natural law. At the same time, however, the natural law does not specify exactly how a murderer must be punished, whether (for example) by means of banishment, the death penalty, or imprisonment. Such details depend upon a number of factors that prudent legislators and judges must take into consideration apart from their understanding of the general principles of natural justice. According to Aquinas, those dictates of natural reason which human beings should recognize as directly pertaining to the natural law, and which are therefore common principles of human law in many different regimes, are embodied in something called the "law of nations" [ius gentium]. Strictly speaking, the law of nations is a human law derived as a set of conclusions from the natural law. On the other hand, the law of nations is not the law of any particular regime and for this reason is sometimes equated with the natural law itself. For Aquinas' treatment of the law of nations (see ST, I-II, 95.4 and ST, II-II, 57.3). Such details are the bases of human laws that Aquinas calls determinations from the natural law. It is important to note that both conclusions and determinations are based on the natural law in some way, for the question of how a murderer or a thief ought to be punished would be meaningless without the more general requirement (found in the natural law itself) that injustice must be met with a punishment that in some way fits the crime. To consider the matter by way of analogy, we may take note of Aquinas' own example in the Summa Theologiae. As he explains, legislators rely upon their understanding of the natural law in the same way that craftsmen must use the "general form of a house" before they build a particular house to which many architectural details may be added (ST, I-II, 95.2). To press the analogy further, just as all houses must be built according to certain general principles (e.g., all houses must have a roof, a foundation, windows, at least one door, etc.), so also all political regimes must enforce certain human laws as conclusions from the natural law (e.g., prohibitions against murder, theft, adultery, and assault). In the same way, just as a house under construction may exhibit a wide array of details not belonging to the "general form" of a house (e.g., some houses have a brick foundation and some are on a concrete slab, some are heated with oil and some with natural gas, etc.), so also political regimes may vary according to similarly non-essential details that Aquinas would call determinations of the natural law (e.g., determining specific punishments for specific crimes).

In Aquinas' view, human laws are essential for the maintenance of any organized and civilized society. At the same time, however, Aquinas understands human laws to be somewhat limited in scope. Several passages in the Summa Theologiae testify to this, including Aquinas' comparison between human law and divine law. As he explains, the very reason why divine law is necessary pertains directly to those areas where human law (and even natural law) fall short. The most obvious example of this is the simple fact that human laws may be in error. Regardless of whether they are intended to be conclusions or determinations of the natural law, human laws are made by fallible human beings and may often tend to hinder the common good rather than promote it. Secondly, Aquinas argues that, given certain circumstances, some human laws may simply fail to apply. This does not necessarily mean that such laws are unjust or even erroneously enacted. Aquinas suggests, rather, that there sometimes arise situations in which securing the common good requires actions that violate the letter of the law. For example, a law that requires the city gates to remain closed during certain times may need to be broken to allow citizens to enter as they are pursued by enemy forces (ST, I-II, 96.6; II-II, 120.1). Thirdly, Aquinas explains that human law is unable to direct the interior acts of a man's soul. As a result, human law has a difficult time directing people toward the path of virtue, since genuine human goodness depends not only on external actions but upon interior movements of the soul, which are hidden. This is not to say that the coercive power of human law may not play some role in leading people to virtue, or even that virtue should not be an express goal of human law (that virtue is an express goal of human law, see ST, I-II, 92.1, 95.1.). It only means that the power of human law is limited by the fallible intellects of the human beings who enforce it and who only see a person's external actions. Finally, human law is unable to "punish or forbid all evil deeds." (ST, I-II, 91.4). By this Aquinas means that human laws must concentrate upon hindering those sorts of behaviors that are most damaging to the commonwealth. Aquinas elaborates upon this by saying that the political community would "do away with many good things" if it attempted to forbid all vices and punish every act that is judged to be immoral. Thus understood, human legislators must remember that most of their subjects need to be governed in relation to their limited capacity for virtue. As a result, "human laws do not forbid all vices, from which the virtuous abstain, but only the more grievous vices, from which it is possible for the majority to abstain; and chiefly those that are to the hurt of others, without the prohibition of which human society could not be maintained: thus human law prohibits murder, theft, and suchlike." (ST, I-II, 96.2).

4. The Requirements of Justice

As we have seen, Aquinas' argument for the necessity of human law includes the observation that some human beings require an additional coercive incentive to respect and promote the common good. By means of the law, those who show hostility to their fellow citizens are restrained from their evildoing through "force and fear," and may even eventually come "to do willingly what hitherto they did from fear, and become virtuous." (ST, I-II, 95.1). During this discussion, Aquinas mentions two specific dimensions of the common good that are of particular concern to human legislation. The first of these is "peace." By this term (pax), Aquinas means something considerably more mundane than any sort of "inner peace" or spiritual tranquility that one finds as a result of moral or intellectual perfection. Instead, he seems to have in mind the requirements for maintaining a social order in which citizens are free from the aggression of wrongdoers and other preventable threats to safety or livelihood. In addition to preserving social order at its most basic level, however, Aquinas also makes clear in the above passage that human law should strive to instill "virtue," and specifically that kind of virtue which has to do with the common good of society. In other words, human law is interested in instilling virtues insofar as those virtues perfect human beings in their dealings with fellow citizens and the broader community as a whole. Later in the Summa Theologiae, Aquinas calls this kind of virtue "legal justice." (ST, II-II.58.5-6; Commentary on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics, Book 5, Lecture 2).

According to Aquinas, legal justice is the political virtue par excellence. Contrary to what its name appears to signify, this virtue does not imply simple obedience to the law. It means, rather, an inner disposition of the human will by which those possessing it refer all their actions to the common good (Aquinas follows Aristotle in calling it "legal" justice because the law, too, has the common good as its proper object. See his Commentary on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics, Book 5, Lecture 2 [902]). Thus understood, Aquinas (again following Aristotle) considers it to be a "general virtue." By this he means that legal justice embraces any act of virtue whatsoever, so long as the agent refers his action to legal justice's proper object. To use Aquinas' example, fortitude is normally considered to be a virtue distinct from justice, since fortitude deals with the perfection of the irascible appetite and a person's ability to overcome fear, whereas justice deals with the perfection of the will and a person's dealings with others. However, a particular act of fortitude may be referred to the common good as its object and thus become an act of justice as well. For example, a soldier who rushes into battle displays fortitude by overcoming his fear of death, but he also displays justice if he is motivated by a love for the common good of the society he protects. Considered specifically, his action is courageous. Considered generally, it is an act of justice. As Aquinas explains, "the good of any virtue, whether such virtue direct man in relation to himself, or in relation to certain other individual persons, is referable to the common good, to which justice directs: so that all acts of virtue can pertain to justice, insofar as it directs man to the common good." (ST, II-II, 58.5).

In addition to considering justice generally, however, Aquinas also considers it as a particular virtue of its own. This seems to explain why he mentions in a later discussion of human legislation that the law should promote justice in addition to peace and virtue (ST, I-II, 96.3). Regardless of the fact that justice is a virtue that legislators would like to instill within their citizens, the law also seeks to preserve justice as a certain kind of fairness. This becomes clearer when one considers Aquinas' discussion of "right" (ius), which he characterizes as the object of justice considered as a particular virtue, and which must be safeguarded by the law regardless of whether legislators have succeeded in implanting the virtue of justice in the souls of their citizens. Strictly speaking, ius is understood by Aquinas as synonymous withiustum, or that which is just in a particular situation (ST, II-II, 57.1). Aside from making their citizens just by cultivating in them the "perpetual and constant will to render to each one his right [ius]," (ST, II-II, 58.1) legislators and judges ensure that the ius of particular situations between individuals is established or restored, that each person receives what is "due" to him such that a certain equality is maintained among citizens. When a judge orders a person to pay $100 to another for a service rendered, for example, that judge reestablishes the equality of their relationship before the service was performed. In such a case, the $100 owed to the provider of the service is his ius, which must be returned if justice in this case is to be accomplished. Again, this is not a sense of justice according to which the one paying his debt necessarily exhibits the virtue of justice, but in the sense that his actions (proceeding from any motivation whatsoever) reestablish that certain equality which can only be restored if the one who owes renders no more and no less of his debt to the one who is owed. To exhibit the virtue of justice, therefore, is much more than to perform an action that reestablishes the equality of justice or renders to someone his ius, and yet without the notion of ius, Aquinas' concept of justice as a virtue would be unintelligible. This is why the concept of ius lies especially at the core of that part of justice which Aquinas characterizes as "particular." In contrast to the general virtue of legal justice, which directs the acts of the other specific virtues to the common good, particular justice always includes some person or group who owes some sort of identifiable debt to another.

In explaining the details of particular justice, Aquinas further distinguishes between commutative justice and distributive justice. The example above involving one person owing $100 to another for a service rendered would be an example of commutative justice, because it involves one private individual's debt to another private individual. It may happen, however, that something is owed to a person by the community as a whole. In this case the community distributes things according to what each individual deserves. An example of this sort of debt would be found in the realm of punitive justice. Since the punishment of criminals is not a matter pertaining to private citizens, but society as a whole (ST, I-II, 92.2 ad 3), a political community owes a certain amount of punishment that must be inflicted upon a criminal if the equality of justice is to be restored. The degree of punishment, furthermore, constitutes the ius of the particular situation. Therefore, just as in matters of exchange, where it would be unjust to fall short of or exceed the ius between buyers and sellers, it would likewise be unjust for a society to punish more or less than the criminal deserves. In addition to punishment, a political society may distribute such things as wealth, honor, material necessities, or work. As Aquinas explains, however, distributive justice seldom requires that society render an equal amount (good or bad) to its members. Following Aristotle's teaching in the Nicomachean Ethics, Aquinas argues that the ius of distributive justice must be calculated according to a "geometrical proportion." By this he simply means that more should be given to those who deserve more and less to those who deserve less. To return to the example of punishment, it would be gravely unfair to punish a murderer with the same penalty as a shoplifter. The equality that justice requires must be considered proportionally in the sense that greater punishments for greater crimes (and lesser punishments for lesser crimes) do in fact constitute equal treatment (Summa Contra Gentiles, III.142 [2]). Such is not the case in matters of commutative justice such as buying and selling, which Aquinas says must follow an "arithmetic proportion." By this Aquinas simply means that the good or service provided must be proportional to the value of the currency or commodity for which it is exchanged (ST, II-II, 61.2;Commentary on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics, Book 5, Lecture 5).

To observe how this teaching is applied to particular situations in the political community, it is helpful to consider Aquinas' famous discussion of usury. Usury inherently constitutes a violation of commutative justice, according to Aquinas, because it creates an unfair inequality among those private individuals in society. Aquinas' logic is extremely straightforward. If I lend someone $1000 there exists a $1000 disparity in his favor. The fact that he owes me this sum of money means that there now exists a ius that obliges him to pay me back the money he borrowed. If, however, I charge him a 10 percent fee for the use of the money lent, I require him to pay back $100 more than he originally borrowed. According to Aquinas, by doing this I would be charging him $100 more than what I am entitled to receive. Since he only borrowed $1000, he should only have to pay me back $1000.

Aquinas' condemnation of usury has little to do with the idea that money should only be lent from the motive of generosity (even if this happens to be a consequence). It is, rather, based on his notion of the nature of money itself. Contrary to most modern economic theories, Aquinas understands money to be nothing more than a medium for exchanging commodities and thus subject to the requirements of commutative justice. Any use of money beyond this purpose distorts its original function. If money can ever be considered a commodity in its own right, it should be compared to those commodities whose use "consists in their consumption." (ST, II-II, 78.1). Its exchange value is more akin to something like food or wine than to a house or a tool. When someone lends his house to be used, it makes perfect sense to charge rent and also to repossess the house when the allotted time for renting has expired. On the other hand, it would be quite unreasonable for a grocer to charge a fee for his food and then additionally to demand the food back after it is used. As Aquinas explains, the exchange value of money should be considered more like food than a house: "Now money, according to the Philosopher, was invented chiefly for the purpose of exchange: and consequently the proper and principal use of money is consumption or alienation whereby it is sunk in exchange. Hence it is by its very nature unlawful to take payment for the use of money lent." (It is necessary to add that Aquinas does allow lenders to require an additional fee under two conditions. The first would be if money is lent to someone entering a business venture in which the lender shares some of the risk [periculum]. If, for example, I lend someone $1000 to invest in renting a vineyard, I am entitled to a share in his profits so long as I also agree to lose some or all of my money if the investment yields a net loss [ST, II-II, 78.2, ad 5]. Secondly, I may charge an additional fee for money lent if lending causes me to suffer some loss that I would have otherwise avoided. For example, if my loan of $1000 to a friend in need prevents me from paying my rent and thus incurring a $100 late fee, I may justly demand $1100 in return to cover my losses [ST, II-II, 78.2, ad 1]). Again, Aquinas condemns usury because it exceeds the ius that justice requires to exist between individuals. The same injustice would exist if one were to take advantage of a buyer's desperation by selling a product for more than its value or to take advantage of a seller's desperation by buying something for less than its value (ST, II-II, 77.1). In either case someone falls short of or exceeds the ius of a given situation, which is inherently contrary the equality that justice requires.

5. The Limitations of Politics

As we have seen, much of Aquinas' political teaching is adapted from the Aristotelian political science which he studied in great detail and which he largely embraced. Perhaps the most central Aristotelian political doctrine in Aquinas' view is the inherent goodness and naturalness of political society. It is also necessary to understand, however, that in addition to being good and natural political society is also limited in several important respects, not all of which would have been pointed out by Aristotle but are unique to Aquinas' teaching. As we have already seen, Aquinas believes that the human laws governing political societies must be somewhat limited in scope. For example, the fact that something like the practice of usury is unjust does not necessarily mean that political society can or should forbid it: "Human laws leave certain things unpunished, on account of the condition of those who are imperfect, and who would be deprived of many advantages, if all sins were strictly forbidden and punishments appointed for them." (ST, II-II, 78.1 ad 3). In this argument, Aquinas is making the simple point that human law is incapable of regulating every dimension of social life. Perhaps he would elaborate that attempting to police the practice of usury may in some cases hinder a society's ability to prevent more serious crimes like murder, assault, and robbery (ST, I-II, 96.2). This is due to the limited nature of human law and political society itself and is one of the reasons why God has wisely chosen to apply his own divine law to human affairs. In addition to its infallibility and the fact that it applies to the "interior movements" of man's soul, divine law is able to punish all vices while demanding the moral perfection from humans that God expects (ST, I-II, 91.4). Human law, on the other hand, must often settle for preventing only those things that imperil the immediate safety of those protected by it. This is not to say that human law does not also look to promote virtue, but the virtues it succeeds in instilling seldom fulfill the full moral capabilities of human citizens.

Secondly, Aquinas' definition of natural law as the human participation in the eternal law also indicates something emphatically trans-political about human nature that cannot be found in the Aristotelian doctrine to which Aquinas largely adapted his own. Whereas Aristotle had argued for the existence of a natural standard of morality, he never suggested an overarching human community with a supreme lawgiver, and yet this is precisely what Aquinas' teaching explicitly affirms (ST, I-II, 91.1-2). Not only is the natural law a universally binding law for all humans in all places (something that Aristotle never recognized), it also points to the existence of a God that consciously and providently governs human affairs as a whole (also something absent from the Aristotelian teaching). Without such divine origins, the natural law would lose its legal character, since under Aquinas' own definition there can be no law that does not derive from someone who "has care of the community." (ST, I-II, 90.3-4) Hence the very existence of natural law implies a more universal community under God that transcends political society. This is also apparent by looking at the epistemological basis of Aquinas' natural law theory. As we have seen, human beings know the precepts of the natural law by a natural habit Aquinas calls synderesis. Whereas these precepts may be reinforced by the political community, they are first promulgated by nature itself and instilled in man's mind by the hand of God. They owe nothing, therefore, to political society for their content. This is considerably different from the Aristotelian doctrine that includes no teaching regarding the self-evident first principles of natural morality upon which Aquinas' natural law theory stands or falls and that seems to suggest (contrary to Aquinas' view) that no universally binding law even exists that is not somewhat subject to change from regime to regime (Nicomachean Ethics, 1134b33). This difference points out in a particularly striking way the un-Aristotelian character of Aquinas' insistence that all regimes, whether they realize it or not, are under God's supreme authority and owe the binding force of their laws to the more fundamental natural law of which God is the sole author.

Finally, political society as Aquinas understands it is limited in an even further sense. We may observe this by returning to Aquinas' claim that political society is natural. In one sense, of course, this affirmation of Aristotle's teaching constitutes a very high exaltation of the political. Only by living in political society is man capable of achieving his full natural potential. Thus understood politics is no mere instrumental good (as in the teachings of modern political thinkers such as Hobbes and Locke), but is part of the very fabric of the human person, and thus the individual's participation in political society is a great intrinsic good for the individual as well as for society. On the other hand, the characterization of politics as natural also means for Aquinas that it falls short of man's ultimate supernatural end. For this reason Aquinas never ceases to remind us that, although politics is natural to man and constitutes an important aspect of the natural law, "man is not ordained to the body politic according to all that he is and has." (ST, I-II, 21.4 ad 3). By this Aquinas means that beyond the fulfillment of the natural law, the active participation in political society, and even the exercise of the moral virtues, human beings find their complete perfection and happiness only in beatitude—the supernatural end to which they are called. Of course, beatitude is only fully completed in the afterlife (ST, I-II, 5.3), but even in his terrestrial existence man is called upon to exercise a supernatural perfection made possible through his active cooperation with God's grace. Precisely because it is a natural institution, political society is not equipped to guide human beings toward the attainment of this higher supernatural vocation. In this respect it must yield to the Church, which (unlike political society) is divinely established and primarily concerned with the distribution of divine grace and the salvation of souls (On Kingship, Book I, Chapters 14-15). Again, to say that political society is merely natural is not to suggest that it should only concern man's basic natural needs such as food, shelter, and safety. The common good that political authorities pursue includes the maintenance of a just society where individual citizens may flourish physically as well as morally. Politics thus promotes the natural virtues (most of all justice), which are themselves the human soul's preparation for the reception of divine grace and the infusion of the supernatural virtues of faith, hope, and, above all, charity. The best one can hope from political society is that citizens will be well disposed to receive the grace available to them through the Church, which transcends politics both in its universality as well as in the finality of its purpose.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

i. Aquinas' Political Writings in English

  • Summa Contra Gentiles, vol. III. 1975. Trans. Vernon Bourke. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Summa Theologiae. 1981. Trans. Fathers of the English Dominican Province. Westminster: Christian Classics.
  • Commentary on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics. 1993. Trans. C. I. Litzinger, O. P. Notre Dame, IN: Dumb Ox Books.
  • Commentary on Aristotle's Politics. 1963. Trans. Ernest L. Fortin and Peter D. O'Neill. In Medieval Political Philosophy: A Sourcebook, eds. Ralph Lerner and Muhsin Mahdi. Toronto, ON: The Free Press of Glencoe.
  • Commentary on Aristotle's Politics. 2007. Trans. Richard Regan. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing.
  • On the Governance of Rulers. 1943. Trans. Gerald B. Phelan. London: Sheed and Ward Publishers.

ii. Two Useful Collections of Aquinas' Political Writings in English

  • On Law, Morality, and Politics. 2002. Trans. Richard Regan. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
  • Aquinas: Political Writings. 2002. Trans. R.W. Dyson. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

b. Secondary Sources

i. Books

  • Oscar, Brown. 1981. Natural rectitude and divine law in Aquinas: an approach to an integral interpretation of the Thomistic Doctrine of Law. Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies.
  • Di Blasi, Fulvio. 2006. God and the Natural Law: A Rereading of Thomas Aquinas. South Bend, IN: St. Augustine's Press.
  • Finnis, John. 1998. Aquinas: Moral, Political and Legal Theory. Oxford University Press.
  • Gilby, Thomas. 1958. The Political Thought of Thomas Aquinas. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Hall, Pamela M. 1994. Narrative and the Natural Law: An Interpretation of Thomistic Ethics. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Kempsall, M.S. 1999. The Common Good in Late Medieval Political Thought. Oxford University Press.
  • Keys, Mary M. 2006. Aquinas, Aristotle, and the Promise of the Common Good. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Malloy, Michael P. 1985. Civil Authority in Medieval Philosophy: Lombard, Aquinas, and Bonaventure. Lanham: University Press of America.
  • Maritain, Jacques. 1951. Man and the State. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Maritain, Jacques. 1947. The Person and the Common Good. New York: Scribner's.
  • Maritain, Jacques. 2001. Natural Law Reflections of Theory and Practice. St. Augustine's Press.
  • McInerny, Ralph. 1997. Ethica Thomistica: The Moral Philosophy of Thomas Aquinas, Washington DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • McInerny, Ralph. 1992. Aquinas on Human Action: A Theory of Practice. Washington DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • Nemeth, Charles. 2001. Aquinas in the Courtroom: Lawyers, Judges, and Judicial Conduct.Westport, CT: Praeger Publishers.
  • Porter, Jean. 2004. Nature As Reason: A Thomistic Theory Of The Natural Law. Wm. B. Eerdmans Publishing Company.
  • Simon, Yves. 1993. Philosophy of Democratic Government. University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Simon, Yves. 1992. The Tradition of Natural Law: A Philosopher's Reflections. Fordham University Press, 1992.
  • Simon, Yves. 1980. A General Theory of Authority. University of Notre Dame Press.

ii. Articles and Chapters

  • Bleakley, Holly Hamilton. 1999. "The Art of Ruling in Aquinas' De Regimine Principum," History of Political Thought 20: 575-602.
  • Blythe, James. 1986. "The Mixed Constitution and the Distinction between Regal and Political Power in the Work of Thomas Aquinas," Journal of the History of Ideas 47: 547-565.
  • Brown, Montague. 2004. "Religion, Politics and the Natural Law: Thomas Aquinas on Our Obligations to Others," Skepsis 15: 316-330.
  • Brown, Oscar. 1979. "Aquinas' Doctrine of Slavery in Relation to Thomistic Teaching on Natural Law,"Proceedings of the American Catholic Philosophical Association 53: 173-181.
  • Crofts, Richard. 1973. "The Common Good in the Political Theory of Thomas Aquinas," Thomist 37: 155-173.
  • Degnan, Daniel. 1982. "Two Models of Positive Law in Aquinas: A Study of the Relationship of Positive and Natural Law," Thomist 46: 1-32.
  • Dewan, Lawrence, O.P. 2002. "Jean Porter on Natural Law: Thomistic Notes," Thomist 66 (2): 275-309.
  • Dewan, Lawrence, O.P. 2000. "St. Thomas, John Finnis, and the Political Good," Thomist 64 (3): 337-374.
  • Dewan, Lawrence, O.P. 1996. "Natural Law and the First Act of Freedom: Maritain Revisited" Maritain Studies 12: 3-32.
  • Eschmann, I.T. 1958. "St. Thomas Aquinas on the Two Powers," Mediaeval Studies 20: 177-205.
  • Eschmann, I.T. 1946, "Studies on the Notion of Society in St. Thomas Aquinas, Part I" Mediaeval Studies 8: 1-42.
  • Eschmann, I.T. 1943. "A Thomistic Glossary on the Principle of the Preeminence of a Common Good,"Mediaeval Studies 5: 123-166.
  • Finnis, John. 2001. "Natural Law, God, Religion, and Human Fulfillment," American Journal of Jurisprudence, 46: 3-36.
  • Finnis, John. 1998. "Public Good: The Specifically Political Common Good in Aquinas" in Natural Law and Moral Inquiry: Ethics, Metaphysics, and Politics in the Work of Germain Grisez, ed., Robert George, (Washington DC: Georgetown University Press) 174-209.
  • Finnis, John. 1987. "Natural Law and Natural Inclinations: Some Comments and Clarifications," New Scholasticism 61: 307-20.
  • Finnis, John. 1981. "The Basic Principles of Natural Law: A Reply to Ralph McInerny," American Journal of Jurisprudence 26: 21-31.
  • Foley, Michael. 2004. "Thomas Aquinas' Novel Modesty," History of Political Thought 25: 402-423.
  • Fortin, Ernest. 1987. "Thomas Aquinas" In The History of Political Philosophy, eds. Leo Strauss and Joseph Cropsey. University of Chicago Press, 248-275.
  • Froelich, Gregory. 1993. "Ultimate End and Common Good," Thomist 57 (4): 609-619.
  • Froelich, Gregory. 1989. "The Equivocal Status of the Common Good," New Scholasticism 63: 38-57.
  • Gelinas, E.T. 1971. "Right and Law in Aquinas," Proceedings of the American Catholic Philosophical Association 45: 130-138.
  • Grisez, Germain. 1965. "The First Principle of Practical Reason: A Commentary on the Summa Theologiae, 1-2, Question 94, Article 2", Natural Law Forum 10: 168-201.
  • Henle, R.J. 1990. "Sanction and the Law According to St. Thomas Aquinas," Vera Lex 5-6.
  • Kreyche, Robert. 1974. "Virtue and Law in Aquinas: Some Modern Implications," Southwestern Journal of Philosophy 5: 111-140.
  • Koritansky, Peter. 2005. "Two Theories of Retributive Punishment: Immanuel Kant and Thomas Aquinas," History of Philosophy Quarterly 22 (4) 319-338.
  • Kries, Douglas. 1990. "Thomas Aquinas and the Politics of Moses," Review of Politics 52: 1-21.
  • Lee, Patrick. 1997. "Is Thomas' Natural Law Theory Naturalist?" American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 71: 567-587.
  • Lee, Patrick. 1982. "Aquinas and Scotus on Liberty and Natural Law," Proceedings of the American Catholic Philosophical Association 56: 70-78.
  • Lustig, Andrew. 1991. "Natural Law, Property, and Justice: The General Justification of Property in Aquinas and Locke," Journal of Religious Ethics 19: 119-149.
  • Lutz-Bachman, Matthias. 2000. "The Discovery of a Normative Theory of Justice in Medieval Philosophy: On the Reception and Further Development of Aristotle's Theory of Justice by St. Thomas Aquinas," Medieval Philosophy and Theology 9: 1-14.
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Author Information

Peter Koritansky
The University of Prince Edward Island

Political Obligation

Why should I obey the law? Apart from the obvious prudential and self-interested reasons (to avoid punishment, loss of reputation, and so forth), is there a moral obligation to do what the law requires just because the law requires it? If the answer is yes and the mere illegality of an act renders its performance prima facie morally wrong, then I am under a political obligation. Political obligation thus refers to the moral duty of citizens to obey the laws of their state. In cases where an act or forbearance that is required by law is morally obligatory on independent grounds, political obligation simply gives the citizen an additional reason for acting accordingly. But law tends to extend beyond morality, forbidding otherwise morally innocent behavior and compelling acts and omissions that are discretionary from an independent moral point of view. In such cases, the sole source of one’s moral duty to comply with the law is his or her political obligation.

Theories of political obligation can be roughly divided into three camps: transactional accounts, natural duty, and associative theories.

Table of Contents

  1. Transactional Accounts
    1. Fairness
    2. Gratitude
    3. Consent
  2. Natural Duty
    1. Utilitarianism
    2. Rights-Protecting Institutions
  3. Associative Theories
  4. Mixed Accounts
  5. Sensitivity to Regime Type
  6. Relationship to Legitimate Authority
  7. The Weight of Political Obligation
  8. Philosophical Anarchism
  9. References and Further Reading

1. Transactional Accounts

Transactional accounts suggest that political obligation is acquired through some morally significant transaction between the citizen and his compatriots or between the citizen and his state.” Three such theories can be distinguished.

a. Fairness

A political community is a cooperative scheme that is geared towards the production of benefits for its members: security, transport, clean water, and so forth. The venture is fruitful in producing these benefits because those participating observe certain restrictions and pay their taxes. To enjoy the benefits of the scheme without submitting to its restrictions is to free-ride on the sacrifices of others, which is unfair. The demands of fairness thus yield political obligation. H.L.A Hart was among the first to articulate this account:

When a number of persons conduct any joint enterprise according to rules and thus restrict their liberty, those who have submitted to those restrictions when required have a right to a similar submission from those who have benefited by their submission. (Hart, 1955: 185)

There are some difficulties with citing fairness as the source of political obligation. Robert Nozick introduces the following thought experiment in Anarchy, State and Utopia. Suppose that a group of your neighbors invest in a public address system and decide to launch a program of public entertainment. They list the names of all of the people in the neighborhood, numbering 365 in total.

On his assigned day a person is to run the public address system, play records over it, give news bulletins, tell amusing stories he has heard, and so on. After 138 days on which each person has done his part, your day arrives. Are you obligated to take your turn? You have benefited from it… but must you answer the call when it is your turn to do so? (Nozick, 1974: 93)

The answer seems to be no. From this Nozick draws the conclusion that one does not acquire an obligation to cooperate with a scheme simply by benefiting from its labors. But examples that produce contrasting intuitions come readily to mind. Suppose that the residents of Nozick’s neighborhood vote to dig a public well, to be paid for and maintained by the members of the neighborhood, as an alternative to tap water that is dangerously polluted. One resident, who feels that the well is completely unnecessary, refuses to have anything to do with the enterprise. The others nevertheless proceed to dig the well and fund its maintenance and, after a fortnight, the dissenter begins to take water from the well. In this case, the dissenter has acquired an obligation to pitch in or to contribute his fair share.

The relevant difference between the two cases is whether the benefits are merely received or positively accepted. In Nozick’s example the benefits of the scheme are simply foisted upon all members of the neighborhood, who have no real choice over whether or not they will receive them. The benefits can be avoided, but not without great inconvenience. One would have to go to great lengths to avoid enjoying the music and entertainment being churned out through the public address system. In the latter case, the dissenter must go out of his way to retrieve water from the public well. Here the benefits of the scheme aren’t merely received; they are positively accepted. This makes all the difference. While the acceptance of a scheme’s benefits may be enough to generate an obligation of fair play, their mere receipt cannot (Simmons 1979: 125-28).

The problem with generalizing from this example is that most of the benefits provided by the state are “open” goods, the enjoyment of which simply cannot be avoided, at least not without great inconvenience. The peaceful and secure environment created by police, roads, and national defense are all cases in point. Since we cannot say that these benefits are “accepted,” it is difficult to maintain that those who enjoy them incur a political obligation of fair play by so doing. Those citizens that take advantage of the readily available but not “open” benefits that society makes available, such as emergency services upon request, may incur a duty to requite, but this cannot give us a sufficiently general account of political obligation (Simmons, 1979: 127-28).

But is “acceptance” always necessary? According to George Klosko, the “mere receipt” of a benefit fails to impose a duty to reciprocate only when the benefit in question is trivial. The force of the argument is blunted once we turn away from “discretionary” benefits that are not essential to well-being, such as entertainment, and towards “presumptive” benefits: goods that are necessary for an acceptable life such that all persons can reasonably be presumed to want them (Klosko 1987: 246). Klosko lists “physical security, protection from a hostile environment, and the satisfaction of basic bodily needs,” offering the following example to illustrate his point: A lives in a small territory surrounded by hostile territories whose leaders have made public their intention to slaughter the citizens of X. In order to defend themselves, the X-ites must band together and institute measures such as compulsory military service. A, however, finds this too burdensome and time consuming and decides not to comply. Although the mutual-protection scheme has simply sprung up around him, we feel that it is wrong for A to free ride on the sacrifices of his fellow X-ites. He must reciprocate for the safety and security that he enjoys because of their efforts (Klosko 1987: 249). From this, Klosko infers that the mere receipt of “presumptive” benefits is enough to create a duty of fair play.

But now the emphasis has shifted from the enjoyment of benefits to the importance of the goods provided. This gives us reason to suspect that considerations of fair play are not ultimately what ground political obligation on Klosko’s picture. Rather an independent imperative to help supply essential goods to one’s compatriots – a “natural duty” – may be what is doing the work (Wellman and Simmons 2005: 189-90). Natural duty theories will be considered in greater detail below.

b. Gratitude

According to this account, a citizen owes a debt of gratitude to the government for the benefits that it provides. This debt is owed regardless of whether these benefits are accepted or merely received, and the debt is repaid through obedience to law.

There are a number of obvious difficulties with this account. First, only a benefactor who makes a special effort or sacrifice is owed a debt of gratitude (Simmons 1979: 170). But public benefits are taxpayer-funded and members of government are paid handsomely for their work. As such, no sacrifice by the government is present. Our fellow citizens collectively do make sacrifices from which we benefit, but insofar as they are compelled to do so, they cannot be the objects of a debt of gratitude. Voluntary benefaction is necessary for any such debt to arise. Furthermore, gratitude is not owed for benefaction that is motivated by malice or self-interest, which means that a government is not owed obedience for services that it provides only to win votes, to improve its reputation in international circles, or for other such disqualifying reasons.

Second, even the concession that citizens owe a debt of gratitude to their government cannot salvage this account, for the content of this debt remains an open question. In other words, it is not clear that the debt must be repaid through obedience, rather than in some other way. Interjecting that this is what governments ask for in return is unsatisfactory since, as Simmons points out, “benefactors are not specially entitled to themselves specify what shall constitute a fitting return for their benefaction” (Simmons, 2002: 34).

c. Consent

On this theory, a citizen that freely consents to his government’s authority binds himself to obedience. Though few deny this, the difficulty with consent theory is identifying an action in the personal history of most individuals that might count as a valid token of consent.

Residence in a government’s territory was said to express “tacit” consent by Locke and Rousseau (Locke, 1690: ch. 8, Rousseau, 1762: IV, ii). The fatal errors of this view are well documented. For an act or omission to register consent, the agent performing it must be aware of the moral significance of what he is doing. One cannot submit to authority and be bound unknowingly (Simmons, 1979: 64). Furthermore, the agent must have the opportunity to withhold consent and doing so must not come at too great a personal cost (otherwise consent cannot be considered free and voluntary). Residence fails to meet each of these criteria. First, if occupying territory expresses consent to the authority of its government, it is safe to say that the greater bulk of citizens in any country are not aware of it. Second, the only way to withhold consent on this view is to emigrate, which is impossible for some and possible but extremely costly for others. Even if the moral significance of residence were known to all, in many cases it would still not be free and voluntary, which consent must be in order to bind - a point articulated by David Hume in “On the Social Contract:”

Can we seriously say that a poor peasant or artisan has a free choice to leave his country, when he knows no foreign language or manners, and lives from day to day, by the small wages which he acquires? (Hume, 1748)

A popular alternative token of consent is that of democratic participation or voting. Weak and strong formulations of democratic consent theory can be distinguished. According to the weak version, to vote for a candidate in a democratic election is to consent to his appointment to a position of political authority and therefore to bind oneself to obedience should that candidate’s bid for power be successful. The strong version states that by participating in a democratic election fully aware that the purpose of the procedure is to invest authority in the candidate that wins the most votes, one consents to the procedure as a way of determining who will wield political power and therefore agrees to be bound by its outcome whichever way it goes. Under this alternative, a democratically elected government is owed obedience by every citizen that partook in the election by which it was empowered.

But every democratic country contains citizens that are, for whatever reason, unable or unwilling to vote. This leaves a large portion of any democratic populace unbound by the duty to obey the law, even on the stronger formulation of democratic consent theory. By identifying voting as our token of consent, we avoid the difficulties associated with the residence account, but are left with a theory of political obligation that is insufficiently general in its scope.

2. Natural Duty

According to natural duty theories, political obligation is grounded not in a morally significant transaction that takes place between citizens and polity, but either 1) in the importance of advancing some impartial moral good, such as utility or justice; or 2) in a moral duty owed by all persons to all others regardless of their transactional history.

a. Utilitarianism

Unlike the theories previously discussed, a utilitarian account of political obligation is forward rather than backward looking, deriving political obligation from the future goods to be produced by obedience, rather than from what citizens have done in the past or what has been done for them. Utilitarianism posits that actions that maximize utility are morally required. Utility is maximized by acts that produce more (or at least as much) happiness and well-being than any alternative course of action that is open to the agent. The duty to obey the law is derived from this: since obedience produces more happiness than disobedience, one must obey.

One of the more interesting utilitarian accounts of political obligation is developed by R.M. Hare. The acts and forbearances that are required of us by law are generally acts that are conducive to the greatest happiness of the greatest number independently of their being required by law. Even in a lawless “state of nature,” the imperative to maximize utility would surely enjoin that we not burgle, assault, or murder our neighbors. But the mere fact that the law requires something generates additional utilitarian reasons for complying according to Hare. He argues that the promulgation and enforcement of a law requiring X increases or amplifies the utility of X-ing and the disutility of refusing or failing to X. There are several ways that it can do this.

First, some actions only produce good consequences when performed in coordination with others. The enforcement of law helps to bring this about. Hare offers the following example. Grant that we are each under a utilitarian obligation to observe clean habits in order to prevent the spread of typhus. Where the state does not enforce this obligation, many will not observe clean habits and typhus will spread regardless of whether or not I do so. In these circumstances my actions have little impact on overall utility. But once a corresponding law is passed and obedience is widely enforced, my failure to delouse myself jeopardizes the successful containment of the disease. The enactment and enforcement of a law thus adds to my pre-existing utilitarian obligation to observe hygiene standards by making it more likely that this will be effective in preventing the spread of typhus.

But this cannot be said for all acts and forbearances. Some seem to have the same utility whether or not they are widely enforced. In these cases, Hare appeals to more mundane considerations to support his conclusion. Laws require enforcement and their transgression demands punishment. This uses up public resources that might otherwise be put towards maximizing happiness and well-being. Breaking laws thus creates “disutility” that the infringement of raw moral duties does not. The mere illegality of an act gives us an independent utilitarian reason to refrain from it (Hare, 1989: 14).

But even if the utility of obedience is enhanced by factors such as these, there will surely still be some occasions on which disobedience would clearly produce more utility all things considered. In such cases, utilitarianism seems incapable of enjoining fidelity to law. This is a problem because, while all duties are prima facie and liable to be overridden by countervailing moral considerations, a moral requirement that gives way in the face of very slight utility gains hardly seems to be an obligation in any meaningful sense of the word (Simmons 1979: 49). Rule-utilitarianism looks more promising in this respect. On this view, what is required is conformity to rules that are justified on utilitarian grounds; that is, rules which maximize utility when complied with generally.  "Obey the law" does seem to be such a rule on the face of it. But if an alternative rule could be identified which would produce even better consequences, then it must supplant the rule “obey the law” according to rule-utilitarianism. And there does seem to be such a rule, namely; obey the law except when disobedience would certainly have better consequences. This takes us back to square one.

b. Rights-Protecting Institutions

Political obligation might alternatively be derived from the natural duties that human rights impose on us. The theory developed by Allen Buchanan in “Political Legitimacy and Democracy” (2002) will serve as an example. To show adequate respect for human rights, it is not enough to refrain from violating them. We must also do what we can to ensure that they are not violated by others, at least when we can do so without sustaining too high a personal cost. This is not a duty that we possess by virtue of having committed ourselves to protecting others. We have it “naturally,” regardless of what we have done in the past or what has been done for us. (Buchanan, 2002: 707).

Obedience helps to ensure that the state functions effectively. If the state does a credible job of protecting the human rights of its citizens, obedience helps to ensure that the human rights of one’s compatriots are protected. To refuse to obey constitutes a refusal to do what one can to protect human rights, which is a transgression of one’s natural duty. Thus, political obligation is among the moral requirements that the human rights of others naturally impose on us.

A major shortcoming of this account, and of all natural duty theories, is their inability to bind individuals to one particular political authority above all others. (This is referred to in the literature as the “problem of particularity.”) A duty to promote justice, utility, or human rights might give a citizen reason to obey and support his own state, but it equally gives him reason to support just and competent states abroad. And if utility, justice, or human rights would be better served by putting the demands of a foreign state ahead of one’s own, then this would seem to be the right thing to do. The money I spend on taxes, for example, would probably do more for justice and human rights if it were instead donated to a poor, developing country, in which case the best way to discharge my natural duty would involve tax evasion.

3. Associative Theories

According to associative accounts, a citizen is duty-bound to obey the law simply by virtue of his or her membership in a political community. In many cases, we are willing to concede that the non-voluntary occupation of a social role comes with moral duties attached. The duties of neighbors, friends, and family are all cases in point. (A daughter owes her parents honor and respect simply because she is their daughter, independently of whatever debt of gratitude she may have accrued). Likewise, political associations are “pregnant of obligation,” such that occupying the role of a “citizen” within such an association comes with its own set of duties, including a duty to obey the law (Dworkin 1986: 206). We simply misunderstand what it means to be a member of a political society if we think that political obligation needs any further justification. (McPherson 1967: 64). Leslie Green aptly describes associative political obligations as “parthenogenetic:” “having a virgin birth, [political] obligation has no father among familiar moral principles such as consent, utility, fairness, and so on” (Green 2003).

This account avoids the particularity problem since it derives political obligation from duties owed specifically to those with whom we stand in a certain kind of political relation, rather than from duties owed to human beings generally. But it is open to other kinds of objections. Even if we accept that there are associative obligations within families and between friends, we might say that the typical political association lacks morally relevant characteristics possessed by the typical family or friendship (e.g. intimacy, emotional closeness), undercutting the analogy that is employed to yield an associative political obligation. “Associativists are united in emphasizing the ‘Uncle’ in ‘Uncle Sam’” writes Wellman. “The obvious problem for this approach is that citizens are not connected to compatriots as they are to uncles” (Wellman 1997: 200).

Or we might allow that families and political associations are relevantly similar, but simply reject the notion of associative obligations. Wellman maintains that associative bonds, allegiances, and attachments may give rise to special responsibilities, but denies that these are tantamount to moral duties (Wellman 1997: 186). We are asked to consider a sibling that decides not to attend his sister’s wedding just because he would rather spend his time and money elsewhere. We may disapprove of this individual given his lack of concern for his sister’s life. But we do not feel that he has failed to do something that his sister has a right against him that he do; we do not feel that he has failed to discharge a duty (Wellman 1997: 186). His behavior is unsavory, but it is not unjust; and if familial ties do not ground special, associative obligations, neither do political associations.

4. Mixed Accounts

Mixed accounts combine elements of two or more of the theories so far discussed. A recent example is Christopher Wellman’s “Samaritan” theory, which derives political obligation from the natural duties of citizens together with their obligations of fair play.

The fist part of Wellman’s theory is not dissimilar to Buchanan’s account, which was sketched above. States depend on widespread obedience to function effectively. An effectively functioning state is necessary to protect people from the dangers inherent in the state of nature. Obedience to the state is therefore necessary to ensure that others are protected from peril. This, Wellman insists, is something that we each have a natural “Samaritan” duty to do. This is the natural duty aspect of Wellman’s account. But obviously the state does not depend on the obedience of each and every citizen 100% of the time in order to function effectively. The non-compliance of a few in the midst of general compliance does not compromise the state’s ability to protect its citizens from the dangers of the state of nature. This presents us with a problem. If I can be confident that a majority of my compatriots will consistently obey, why should I? The state will continue to fulfill its protective function regardless of what I do and no one’s safety is jeopardized by my infidelity to law. It seems that by disobeying, I am not doing anything that is inconsistent with my Samaritan duty to defend others from peril.

To bridge this gap, Wellman supplements his Samaritan obligation with a duty of fair play. Contributing one’s fair share to the achievement of the Samaritan objective – defending others from peril – requires obedience even when disobedience would seem to be inconsequential. It would be unfair to shirk one’s share of the “Samaritan chore” (Wellman 2004: 749).

The trouble with mixed accounts is that they seem prone to inherit the difficulties associated with the theories of which they are composed. Complementing a natural duty with a principle of fairness does not, for example, cause the “problem of particularity” to disappear. Rather, the problem seems to carry over and contaminate Wellman’s mixed theory. (Why do I have a duty to contribute a fair share to the “Samaritan chore” in my own community, rather than in some foreign state?) Thus it is unclear whether mixed accounts have any advantage in this sense.

5. Sensitivity to Regime Type

Whether liberal democracy is a precondition of political obligation depends on which of the above theories we apply. The gratitude account does not appear to preclude citizens owing obedience to undemocratic and tyrannical regimes. To be sure, the depth of one’s debt of gratitude depends on the extent to which he or she benefits, so it is safe to say that democratic citizens will typically owe more than authoritarian subjects by way of requital. Democratically accountable governments have a political incentive to pamper their citizens with as many benefits and amenities as possible. Furthermore, a subject that is denied the rights and liberties afforded to his democratic counterparts has less to be grateful for. Nevertheless the subjects of authoritarian governments might still enjoy substantial benefits thanks to their state – stable employment, security against crime, foreign invasion, and so forth. – and as long as they do, they owe a debt of gratitude and therefore political obligation.

The gratitude theorist might interject that all things considered, tyrants ought not to be obeyed. The injustices perpetrated by such regimes ought to be resisted even if this means failing to repay one’s debt of gratitude. But this does not deny that political obligation is owed to tyrants; it merely concedes that political obligation is prima facie and can sometimes be overridden by countervailing moral considerations. While the gratitude account can in this way be supplemented so as to avoid extending to the oppressed an all things considered duty to obey, the important point is that it cannot confine prima facie political obligation to the citizens of liberal democracies.

On the face of it, it would seem that fairness theory’s sensitivity to regime type is no different from that of the gratitude account. Insofar as democratic citizens typically receive more benefits, what constitutes a “fair share” for them to contribute in return might be more than what non-democratic citizens owe. But the latter are still bound to reciprocate for the goods that they do enjoy.

But A.J. Simmons denies that this is the case. “Fair play” obligations, he says, can only arise in a liberal democratic setting:

Only political communities which at least appear to be reasonably democratic will be candidates for a “fair play account” to begin with. For only where we can see the political workings of the society as a voluntary, cooperative venture will the principle apply. Thus, a theorist who holds that the acceptance of benefits from a cooperative scheme is the only ground of political obligation, will be forced to admit that in at least a large number of nations, no citizens have political obligations (Simmons 1979: 136-37).

The claim here is not that we are only obliged to discharge our duties of fair play if we happen to live in a democracy, but that prima facie duties of fair play cannot even arise in states that aren’t liberal democratic (Simmons 1979: 136-37). Simmons’ remarks, however, seem wrongheaded. What characteristics must a society possess in order to count as a “voluntary, cooperative venture?” Presumably, those participating would have to do so of their own free will, which is tantamount to saying that their involvement must be consensual. Now when Simmons says that a society must be a voluntary cooperative enterprise for the fairness account to have purchase, he surely cannot mean that only where every member of a society is a voluntary participant can fairness be invoked to yield political obligation. For not even liberal democracies will meet this standard. More importantly, if a society did manage to meet this standard, the fairness principle would become redundant: everybody would be under a political obligation simply by virtue of having consented to participate in the scheme. Hence Simmons can only mean that a society must contain a core enterprise that is voluntary and cooperative, made up of consenting participants, which makes benefits available to those outside the core and thus binds them to reciprocate even though they aren’t voluntary participants. But in this case he cannot plausibly maintain that it is only possible for liberal democracies to satisfy this condition, for authoritarian societies also seem to contain a core of voluntary participants cooperating and making benefits available to the rest.

Is liberal democracy necessary for political obligation on consent theory? At first glance, the answer appears to depend on the token of consent identified. Where consent is registered by voting, then clearly a society must be democratic in order for its citizens to be under a political obligation. On the other hand if consent is expressed through mere residence, it would seem that the denial of rights and liberties – free speech, democracy, and so forth – has no bearing on the issue of consent and political obligation.

But closer inspection reveals that this is mistaken. Consent is only morally binding if expressed under the right conditions, whichever form it happens to take, a point alluded to by John Rawls in A Theory of Justice: “it is generally agreed that extorted promises are void ab initio. But similarly, unjust social arrangements are themselves a kind of extortion, even violence, and consent to them does not bind” (Rawls, 1971: 343). Rawls’ conclusion is correct, but his reasoning here is faulty. The voluntariness of consent is not necessarily undermined by the injustice of the state consented to, particularly if the consenter is not himself the target of oppression. But we can plausibly raise doubts as to whether consent, however it is registered, is fully informed when given to an unjust state, which seems to be the route taken by Michael Walzer:

It is not enough that particularly striking acts of consent be free; the whole of our moral lives must be free so that we can freely prepare to consent, argue about consenting, intimate our consent to other men and women… Civil liberty of the most extensive sort is, therefore, the necessary condition of political obligation and just government. Liberty must be as extensive as the possible range of consenting action – over time and through political space – if citizens can conceivably be bound to a strict obedience (Walzer, 1970: xii).

Thus one could say that regardless of the token of consent identified, its validity is conditional upon liberal democratic institutions.

Finally, let us turn to natural duty theories. On the utilitarian account, wherever obedience would generate more happiness and well-being than disobedience, this is what morality requires. Thus if we had some reason to believe that obedience maximizes utility in democratic countries and fails to do so everywhere else, only then would the utilitarian say that democracy is a necessary condition of political obligation. However this empirical premise seems somewhat farfetched.

The natural duty to promote justice, on the other hand, extends political obligation only to the citizens of “reasonably just” states, according to Rawls, or states where each person has an equal right to the most extensive set of liberties compatible with a similar set of liberties for others. This demands stringent protection of basic human rights such as personal security, as well as of property rights, freedom of conscience, freedom of speech and association, and so on. Also, all citizens are to be afforded some kind of democratic participation. Therefore, the duty to promote justice only entails an obligation to obey liberal democracies. The subjects of other kinds of regimes might be said to have a duty to comply only when their so doing would “assist in the establishment of just arrangements” (Rawls 1971: 334), but not a general, content-independent political obligation owed to their state. Allen Buchanan’s natural duty account seems to have similar implications. On Buchanan’s theory, the duty to obey the law is grounded in the natural duty to make rights-protecting institutions available to others. It follows that “failed” states that do not competently fulfill this protective function and illiberal regimes that actually trample on human rights themselves cannot be owed obedience.

6. Relationship to Legitimate Authority

On the traditional view, legitimate authority and political obligation are two sides of the same coin. A state is “legitimate” in the sense of having a right to issue and enforce directives if and only if its citizens are under a political obligation. If citizens do not have a prima facie obligation to obey the law, their government does not have a right to promulgate and enforce it (Simmons 1979: 195).

There are, however, alternative accounts that decouple political obligation from legitimate authority. Kent Greenawalt, for example, argues that a legitimate government’s “justification right” – its right to make and enforce law - implies a duty of non-interference on the part of the citizenry, but not a duty to obey (Greenawalt, 1999). However, if what is meant by “interference” is interference with the state’s regulation of society, it is not clear that interference and disobedience can coherently be distinguished. Thomas Christiano illustrates the point with a couple of clever comparisons, the first between the state and the baseball umpire, and the second between the state and the movie director. “If a player does nothing to prevent the umpire from watching the pitches and shouting ‘ball’ or ‘strike,’ but refuses to leave the batter’s box after having been called out, he interferes with the umpires calling of the game.” Similarly if an actor on the set of a movie does not actively try to sabotage the production of the film but refuses to follow the director’s instructions, he interferes with the production of the film nevertheless. In the same way, Christiano argues, a citizen that does not attack police or make bomb threats to parliament house in order to obstruct the making of law, but that refuses to obey the law is still guilty of interfering with the state’s legal organization of society. Disobedience is interference. (Christiano, 2004)

William Edmundson avoids this difficulty by specifying that the correlate of legitimate authority is non-interference with the administration and enforcement of laws, rather than non-interference with the state’s regulation of society more broadly. Similarly Patrick Durning argues that legitimate authority corresponds to a duty not to interfere with the state’s attempts to regulate society, which amounts to a duty not to interfere with the issuing of commands and their enforcement. (Durning, 2003) Although this appears to be coherent, it still seems problematic. If we do not have a moral obligation to surrender a percentage of our earnings in tax, for example, how can we be duty-bound to stand idly by and not resist when the taxman comes to seize our money? Alternative accounts such as those put forward by Edmundson and Durning have the odd implication that one can be duty-bound not to resist the enforcement of directives that one has absolutely no moral obligation to comply with. For this reason, the traditional view, according to which legitimate authority and political obligation are correlates, remains the prevailing view.

7. The Weight of Political Obligation

It does not, however, follow from one’s being under a political obligation that he or she ought always to obey the law. Political obligation is prima facie and countervailing moral considerations always need to be taken into account when assessing the right course of action. The weight that should be ascribed to political obligation in any such judgment is, furthermore, an open question.

M.B.E Smith argues that it is negligible. A prima facie duty has considerable weight if and only if; 1) “an act which violates that obligation and fulfils no other is seriously wrong;” and 2) “violation of it will make considerably worse an act which on other grounds is already wrong” (Smith, 1973: 970). Running a stop sign when it is perfectly safe to do so and when there is nobody else around to witness and be influenced by the indiscretion, constitutes a transgression of a citizen’s political obligation. Yet it seems to be a rather trivial wrong for which censure and moral condemnation are not appropriate responses. Political obligation thus flunks the first test. As for the second test, Smith argues that the moral wrongness of an act is not at all amplified by its illegality. Rape and murder are already seriously wrong. They are not made more wrong by the fact that these actions are against the law. From this Smith concludes that political obligation is “at most of trifling weight” (Smith, 1973: 971). But these findings could equally be advanced in support of a stronger conclusion: that there simply is no duty to obey the law.

8. Philosophical Anarchism

There is today a growing consensus to the effect that no theory of political obligation succeeds. But not everybody infers from this that political obligation does not exist. After all, the source and nature of moral requirements more generally may not be adequately captured by any of our theories, but few advance this as proof that we are not bound by moral requirements. We have simply been unable to explain why we are so bound: the theorist has failed to develop a satisfactory account of what is there (or at least might be there). But there are also those for whom the theories surveyed above are exhaustive. All possible grounds of political obligation are covered by these theories, such that if political obligation cannot be derived from either consent, or fairness, or gratitude, then there is no such thing as political obligation (Simmons 1979: 192).

“Philosophical anarchism” is the term used to describe this latter position – that there is no prima facie duty to obey the law, even in a just state, (the flip- side of this being that no state is “legitimate” in the sense of enjoying a right to obedience). Two kinds of philosophical anarchism can be distinguished: A posteriori and a priori.

According to a posteriori philosophical anarchism, no existing state is legitimate or has a right to obedience, but political obligation might be owed to an authority if it satisfied certain conditions. In other words, existing states are illegitimate because of their contingent characters (Simmons 2001: 106). A proponent of this view might, for example, say that residence would generate political obligation if internal succession were allowed and if there were a widely known convention equating residence with consent, but that in so far these conditions do not obtain in any existing state, no existing state is owed obedience (Beran, 1987: 126).

A priori philosophical anarchism, by contrast, denies not only the existence, but also the possibility of a legitimate state. There cannot be a duty to obey the law on this view (Edmundson, 2004: 219, Simmons 2001: 105). Robert Paul Wolff endorses this position. Wolff argues that obedience - acting as the law requires just because the law requires it – is incompatible with the overriding duty of each individual to act in accordance with his or her own moral judgment. Differently put, obedience constitutes an abdication of moral autonomy, which is immoral. This precludes citizens from acquiring political obligation no matter what they say or do. We are necessarily free from political obligation and, accordingly, the notion of a legitimate state “must be consigned [to] the category of the round square, the married bachelor, and the unsensed sense-datum” (Wolff 1970: 71). None of this has anything to do with the contingent character of one’s government (Hopton 1998: 601).

If political obligation does not exist, what follows? Locke declares that an individual "under the exercise of a power without right" - the power of an authority without a claim to his obedience - is "at liberty to appeal to heaven" or to resort to violent resistance (Locke, 1690: II: 168). On this view, philosophical anarchism offers something of a justification for political anarchism – disobedience and resistance to the state. But one can have strong moral reasons for complying with directives issued by his government without owing any obligations to that government. A state might deserve obedience without being entitled to it. Moreover the acts and forbearances required by law are in many cases morally required independently of the law. The fact that a citizen is free from political obligation means only that the law’s demanding something of him is not in itself a morally relevant consideration for behaving accordingly. But the citizen’s pre-existing moral duties will in many (or even most) cases be sufficient to prohibit his acting contrary to the law. Thus, the absence of political obligation does not challenge our understanding of when morality demands conformity with law and non-resistance as dramatically as one might expect.

9. References and Further Reading


  • Allen, R.E., Socrates and Legal Obligation, (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1980).
  • Edmundson, W.A., “State of the Art: The Duty to Obey the Law,” Legal Theory, vol. 10, (2004): 215-259.
  • Edmundson, W.A. (ed.), The Duty to Obey the Law, (Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield, 1999).
  • Green, L., “Legal Obligation and Authority,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, 2003.
  • Hopton, T., “Political Obligation,” in Encyclopedia of Applied Ethics, vol. 3, (San Diego: academic Press, 1998).
  • Klosko, G., Political Obligations, (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005).
  • McPherson, T., Political Obligation, (London: Routledge, 1967).
  • Pateman, C., The Problem of Political Obligation: A Critique of Liberal Theory, (Cambridge: Polity Press, 1979).
  • Rousseau, J.J., The Social Contract and Discourses by Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1762), trans. G.D.H Cole, (London and Toronto: J.M. Dent and Sons, 1913).
  • Simmons, A.J., “Civil Disobedience and the Duty to Obey the Law,” in R.G. Frey and C.H. Wellman (eds.), A Companion to Applied Ethics (Blackwell Publishing, 2003).
  • Simmons, A.J., Moral Principles and Political Obligations, (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1979).
  • Woozley, A.D., Law and Obedience: The Arguments of Plato’s Crito, (London: Duckworth, 1979).


  • Hart, H.L.A, “Are There Any Natural Rights?” Philosophical Review 64, (April 1955).
  • Klosko, G., “Presumptive Benefit, Fairness, and Political Obligation,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, vol. 16, no. 3, (Summer 1987): 241-259.
  • Klosko, G., The Principle of Fairness and Political Obligation, (Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield, 1992).
  • Nozick, R., Anarchy, State, and Utopia, (New York: Basic Books, 1974).
  • Rawls, J., A Theory of Justice, (Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1971).
  • Simmons, A.J., “The Principle of Fair Play,” and “Fair Play and Political Obligation: Twenty Years Later,” both in his Justification and Legitimacy: Essays on Rights and Obligations, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001).


  • Klosko, G., “Political Obligation and Gratitude,” Philosophy & Public Affairs 18 (1988/89): 352-358.
  • Walker, A.D., “Obligations of Gratitude and Political Obligation,” Philosophy & Public Affairs 18, (1988/89): 359-364.
  • Walker, A.D., “Political Obligation and the Argument from Gratitude,” Philosophy & Public Affairs 17, (1987/88): 191-211.


  • Beran, H., The Consent Theory of Political Obligation, (New York: Croom Helm, 1987).
  • Hume, D., “On the Social Contract,” in A. MacIntyre (ed.), Hume’s Ethical Writings, (New York: Collier-Macmillan, 1965).
  • Jenkins, J.J., “Political Consent,” Philosophical Quarterly, vol. 20 (1970): 60-66.
  • Locke, J., The Second Treatise of Civil Government, (1690) (any edition).
  • Plamenatz, J.P., Consent, Freedom and Political Obligation, 2nd ed., (London, Oxford, New York: Oxford University Press, 1968).
  • Plamenatz, J.P., Man and Society, vol. 1, (London: Longman, 1963).
  • Singer, P., Democracy and Disobedience, (New York and London: Oxford University Press, 1973).
  • Walzer, M., Obligations: Essays on Disobedience, War and Citizenship, (New York: Simon and Schuster, 1970).

Natural Duty:

  • Bentham, J., “A Fragment of Government,” in J. Bowring (ed.), The Works of Jeremy Bentham, (London: Simpkin, Marshall and Co., 1843).
  • Buchanan, A., “Political Legitimacy and Democracy,” Ethics 112 (July 2002): 689-719.
  • Hare, R.M., “Political Obligation,” in Essays on Political Morality, (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1989).
  • Klosko, G., “Political Obligation and the Natural Duties of Justice,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, vol. 23, no. 3, (Summer 1994): 251-70.
  • Wellman, C.H., and A. John Simmons, Is there a Duty to Obey the Law?, (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2005).

Associative theories:

  • Dworkin, R., Law’s Empire, (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, Belknap, 1986).
  • Horton, J. Political Obligation, (Houndmills, Basingstoke, Hampshire: Macmillan, 1992).
  • Simmons, A.J., “Associative Political Obligations,” in his Justification and Legitimacy: Essays on Rights and Obligations, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001).

Mixed accounts:

  • Wellman, C.H., “Toward a Liberal Theory of Political Obligation,” Ethics, vol. 111, no. 4, (July 2001): 735-759.
  • Klosko, G., “Multiple Principles of Political Obligation,” Political Theory 32, 6, (2004): 801-824.
  • Lefkowitz, D.A., “Legitimate Authority and the Duty of Those Subject to It: A Critique of Edmundson,” Law and Philosophy 23, (2004): 399-435.
  • Miller, D., On Nationality, (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995).

Relationship to legitimate authority:

  • Christiano, T., “Justice and Disagreement at the Foundations of Political Authority,” Ethics, 110 (October 1999): 165-187.
  • During, P., “Political Legitimacy and the Duty to Obey the Law,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, vol. 33, no. 3, (September 2003): 373-390.
  • Edmundson, W.A., “Legitimate Authority without Political Obligation,” Law and Philosophy, 17, (1998): 43-60.
  • Greenawalt, K., “Legitimate Authority and the Duty to Obey” in William A. Edmundson (ed.), The Duty to Obey the Law, (Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield, 1999).

The weight of political obligation, and philosophical anarchism:

  • Dagger, R., “Philosophical Anarchism and its Fallacies: A Review Essay,” Law and Philosophy 19, (2000): 391-406.
  • Edmundson, W.A., Three Anarchical Fallacies: An Essay on Political Authority, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998).
  • Simmons, A.J., “Philosophical Anarchism” in his Justification and Legitimacy: Essays on Rights and Obligations, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001).
  • Smith, M.B.E., “Is there a Prima Facie Obligation to Obey the Law?” Yale Law Journal, vol. 82, (April 1973): 950-976
  • Wolff, R.P., In Defense of Anarchism, (New York, Evanston and London: Harper and Row, 1970).

Author Information

Ned Dobos
University of Melbourne

Jane Addams (1860—1935)

addamsJane Addams was an activist and prolific writer in the American Pragmatist tradition who became a nationally recognized leader of Progressivism in the United States as well as an internationally renowned peace advocate. Addams is primarily acclaimed for founding the Chicago social settlement, Hull-House, which emerged as the flagship of the Settlement Movement. Hull-House provided Addams with a supportive intellectual community and a basis for understanding urban life amidst rapid immigrant influx. Together with other Hull-House residents, Addams undertook a number of local, state, national and ultimately international activist projects including garbage collection, adult education, child labor reform, labor union support, women’s suffrage and peace advocacy among others. Her personal accomplishments are staggering and are recounted in a number of contemporary biographies. Addams helped to found the National Association for the Advancement of Colored People, the American Civil Liberties Union and the Women’s International League for Peace and Freedom. In 1931, she was awarded the Nobel Peace Prize.

Addams’ achievements as a social reformer represent a prodigious legacy but she also left a significant intellectual heritage. She authored a dozen books and over 500 articles of original social philosophy as recognized by her contemporaries including John Dewey, William James, and George Herbert Mead. The organizing principle of her social philosophy was progress. To this end, Addams understood democracy as both a form of socially engaged living and as a framework for social morality. Accordingly, authentic social advancement should be democratic or what she termed “lateral progress,” an inclusive advancement not just narrowly applied to the privileged. Addams argued that fostering the moral relations necessary for a robust democracy required community members to engage in “sympathetic knowledge,” an approach to learning about one another for the purpose of caring and acting on one another’s behalf. Addams’ writings emphasize direct experience, pluralism and fallibility in the engagement with concrete social issues. Although the works of male philosophers such as Dewey, Peirce, James and Mead dominate the literature of classic American pragmatism, the writings of Jane Addams provide a unique and provocative feminist pragmatist voice.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Social Philosophy
    1. Sympathetic Knowledge
    2. Lateral Progress
    3. Pluralism
    4. Democracy
    5. Fallibilism
  3. Themes
    1. Peace
    2. Education
    3. Women’s Advancement
    4. Economics
  4. Philosophical Legacy
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Literature
      1. Books
      2. Selected Articles
      3. Collections
    2. Secondary Literature
    3. Biographies

1. Biography

Laura Jane Addams was born on September 6, 1860 in Cedarville, Illinois, ten months after the publication of Darwin’s Origin of The Species, two months prior to the election of Abraham Lincoln to the presidency of the United States and seven months prior to the secession of the South from the Union. Addams recounts her early life in Twenty Years at Hull-House, the only one of her works to continuously remain in print since it was first published in 1910. As a child she was called “Jennie” but her childhood had a turbulent beginning. When Jennie was two, her mother, Sarah, died whilst giving birth to her ninth child. As a result, Addams formed a significant bond with her father, John, who was a successful mill owner and politician. John Addams corresponded with Lincoln, and Jane Addams associated her father and Lincoln as moral icons and personal inspirations throughout her life. The relationship between John and his daughter was important because it afforded Jane the attention of an educated and worldly adult, an opportunity not experienced by many young women of this era. John Addams remarried but there was always a special bond between Jane and he.

John Addams sent his daughter to college at the Rockford Female Seminary (later Rockford College). Although Addams was always a good student, she blossomed in college and became a widely acknowledged campus leader. Addams learned how valuable a supportive female community could be given women’s exclusion from most activities in the public sphere. She later replicated the woman-centered atmosphere at Hull-House. When Addams graduated from college in 1881, she intended to pursue a medical career, but after a short tine in graduate school, she decided that medicine was not in her future. The death of her father in that same year placed her life in turmoil. Having lost direction in her life, she fell into a decade-long phase of soul searching, combined with sporadic health problems. During this period she undertook several trips to Europe. On her second trip, she encountered the pioneering social settlement, Toynbee Hall in London. Toynbee Hall provided young men an opportunity to work to improve the lives of impoverished Londoners. Soon after this encounter Addams developed a plan to start a social settlement in the United States.

Addams enlisted the help of her friend Ellen Gates Starr in her noble scheme. Starr had briefly attended Rockford College with Addams, so they shared an understanding of the empowerment that a female community could provide to its residents. Addams and Starr open the Hull-House settlement in 1889 in the heart of a run-down neighborhood on the west side of Chicago. They began with few plans, few resources and few residents but with a desire to be good neighbors to the community. Working with the network of women’s organizations in Chicago, the number of Hull-House projects quickly grew, as did their reputation. Women, and to a lesser extent men, came from all over the country to live and work as part of this progressive experiment in communal living combined with social activism. Under Addams’ leadership, Hull-House opened a public bathhouse, undertook a campaign to have the garbage collected, started a kindergarten, developed the first playground in Chicago and responded to a variety of community needs. At first, Addams had rented the entire second floor and the first floor drawing room of the Hull-House building but eventually the settlement complex grew to accommodate one full city block. Addams faced an ongoing challenge to explain the work Hull-House had undertaken. People often felt compelled to give settlement projects the familiar label of charity work, but Addams rebuffed this claim. As she explained in her 1893 article, “The Objective Value of the Social Settlement,” Addams viewed Hull-House residents as engaged in reciprocal knowledge work: the collection, analysis and dissemination of information combined with intelligent action.

Addams was an effective activist and organizer but she was also keenly attuned to social theory. As a child she had read widely, largely influenced by her father who housed the town library in their home. At Rockford, she was exposed to Ancient Greek philosophy as well as the social theories of the Romantics, John Ruskin and Thomas Carlyle. At Hull-House, Addams attracted the attention of John Dewey, William James and George Herbert Mead, each of whom visited and engaged Addams in lively conversations that proved to be mutually influencing. Given this intellectual foundation, Addams used her Hull-House experience as a springboard for developing public philosophy in the American Pragmatist Tradition. In 1899, ten years after founding Hull-House, Addams published, “The Function of the Social Settlement” in which she placed her progressive activities in epistemological terms. Addams viewed issues of knowledge as the most profound contemporary challenge. Social settlements were an active effort to learn about one another across class and cultural divides thus building collective knowledge about the individuals who make up this diverse society. In this manner, Hull-House served as a multi-directional conduit of information about human lives: Addams and her cohorts helped immigrants learn how to navigate the complex American culture while Addams communicated and thematized her experience with immigrants to help white, upper and middle class America understand what it meant to be poor and displaced. Furthermore, Addams viewed this knowledge creation as reciprocal: society benefited from the knowledge that immigrants brought and the immigrants benefited from learning about their new neighbors. Addams was unique in recognizing that immigrants could contribute to American culture.

Addams authored or co-authored a dozen books and over 500 articles after she founded Hull-House. The articles appeared in both scholarly and popular periodicals, establishing Addams as a public philosopher and social leader. Addams was also a much in-demand speaker and she traveled nationally and internationally to make presentations that supported her progressive values. Addams was one of the few women of the era to transgress the private sphere to successfully influence the public sphere. Polls indicate that Addams became one of the most recognized and admired figures in the United States. She was an influential catalyst for change, lending her name and organizing skills to a variety of causes. Addams worked with W.E.B. DuBois in support of a number of African-American endeavors including writing articles for his publication The Crisis and helping to found the National Association for the Advancement of Colored People. She helped start the American Civil Liberties Union and organized the Women’s International League for Peace and Freedom. Her tireless effort in support of peace led to Addams receiving the 1931 Nobel Peace prize. Addams died of cancer on May 21, 1935. The public memorial at Hull-House filled the streets with mourners and eulogies were published in newspapers nationally and internationally.

2. Social Philosophy

There are a number of reasons why Addams was not generally recognized as a philosopher until the late twentieth century which include her gender and her association with social work. Another factor in this lack of recognition is that she was not a systematic philosopher either stylistically or methodologically. Addams’ writing style is not typical of the philosophic tradition in that it lacks a sustained abstract character. For example, in Democracy and Social Ethics, arguably the most philosophical of Addams’ books, the chapters address charity workers, family relationships, domestic workers, industrial working conditions, educational methods and political reforms. To the trained philosopher, these topics appear far removed from more familiar considerations of epistemology, metaphysics and ethics. However, a careful examination of her work reveals that Addams begins with social phenomena and draws theoretical inference from these experiences. In Democracy and Social Ethics, Addams offers intriguing, even radical, insights into the nature of ethics and epistemology. To read Addams as a philosopher requires setting aside assumptions about beginning from abstract theoretical positions. As a pragmatist, Addams is strictly interested in social philosophy. Everything she writes seeks what James would refer to as the “cash value” of an idea for social growth and improvement. Four interrelated cornerstones of her social philosophy are the concepts of sympathetic knowledge, lateral progress, pluralism and fallibilism.

a. Sympathetic Knowledge

Beginning with her first book, Democracy and Social Ethics and running through all of her works addressing social issues is the notion of sympathetic knowledge. Fundamentally, sympathetic knowledge is the idea that humans can learn about one another in terms that move beyond propositional knowledge, that is rather than merely learning facts, knowledge is gained through openness to disruptive knowledge. Knowledge can be disruptive in the sense that new information can transform one’s perceived experience and understanding. This idea motivated Addams and the residents of Hull-House to undertake the first urban study of racial demographics, which was published as Hull-House Maps and Papers in 1895. Addams integrated epistemological inquiry with ethical analysis such that it was the responsibility of members of a society to know one another better for the purposes of caring and acting on one another’s behalf. Sympathetic knowledge is Addams’ rationale behind social settlements. By providing a physical location where people of different backgrounds could meet, social knowledge is built up reducing the abstraction of distant others transforming them into concrete, known others. Accordingly, Addams suggests that the many social activities sponsored by Hull-House—clubs, dances, performances, athletics—were not frivolous affairs but a means for breaking down barriers between people, thus fostering sympathetic knowledge. In Twenty Years at Hull-House and later in The Second Twenty Years at Hull-House, Addams claims that these social activities performed an educative function and that social settlements were in fact thoroughly educative projects. Like Dewey, Addams valued education as the foundation of a healthy democratic society. Like Mead, Addams viewed “play” as an essential aspect of education because of its ability to fire the imagination. Addams takes this notion so far as to argue that play is important for a vibrant democracy because it creates the possibility of empathetic imagination. When one plays, one takes on the roles of others and through fictitious inhabitation of these positions begins to empathize with the plight of others. In this manner, education also contributes to sympathetic knowledge. Similarly, literature and drama can enhance sympathetic knowledge as one empathizes with fictitious characters. Accordingly, Hull-House sponsored community theater as well as the reading of novels.

The basis of sympathetic knowledge is experience that is imaginatively extrapolated. When Addams addresses prostitution in A New Conscience and an Ancient Evil, she employs anecdotes from the Hull-House community to allow her audience to understand the struggles of young women in the big cities. In this manner, she is neither strictly deontological nor teleological in her moral approach. Rather than dealing with principles of sexuality, for example, or the consequences of prostitution on society, although both considerations are important, Addams begins by attempting to increase knowledge of marginalized women. Inherent in this approach to human ontology is a belief in the fundamental goodness and relationality of people. Addams believes that if her audience understands what is going on in the lives of others, even if those others are outcasts, then we may begin to care and possibly take positive action on their behalf. Addams’ method of sympathetic knowledge extends to those with whom she disagreed. For example, in Democracy and Social Ethics, Addams describes her failed political battles with local ward alderman, Johnny Powers (who Addams does not name in print). Hull-House sponsored a number of unsuccessful attempts to unseat Powers. Rather than excoriate Powers for his backroom deals and bribery, Addams set out to understand what made such an alderman popular. Through this method of inquiry, Addams, although not altering her denunciation of Powers’ cronyism, began to understand how the people of the ward appreciated an alderman who was visible and connected to their everyday lives. For Addams, sympathetic knowledge, despite its emotive implications, was a rational attempt to understand others. Accordingly, Addams eschewed antagonism. Ad hominem attacks only foster defensive barriers so Addams employed sympathetic knowledge in what she described as a detached manner. Such an approach might seem counter intuitive, but is understandable for a figure like Addams who bridged the reserved nature of the Victorian era and the moral commitment of the Progressive era.

b. Lateral Progress

Given her status as one of the leading figures of the progressive era, it is not surprising that Addams advocated social progress, but she distinguished the particular type of progress she advocated. The industrial revolution had seen many people prosper in the name of economic and technological progress. In addition, Addams had grown up in the post-Civil War era where social progress had been attributed to the newfound rights of African-Americans. Addams, however, viewed such progress to be more abstract than concrete. In the case of economic progress, it was experienced mostly by an elite few with some benefits trickling down to the middle class. From her perspective at Hull-House, she witnessed the inability of immigrants to fully participate in the economy or the political process. Similarly, she saw that although African-Americans ostensibly had legal rights, they often were prevented from actualizing those rights through a combination of laws intended to circumvent equality and racism in social relations. Given these experiences, Addams advocated what she referred to as “lateral progress,” or the idea that for authentic progress to take place, it would have to be experienced in a widespread manner rather than by a privileged few. Furthermore, Addams’ notion of lateral progress was not to be enforced hierarchically from structures of authority. Addams envisioned a progress that was derived from participatory democratic processes.

Addams applied the concept of lateral progress to a number of social issues. When it came to women’s suffrage, for example, Addams did not base her arguments upon principles of equality or fairness. Instead, she argued that such a move represented lateral progress, the inclusion of all—including women—would lead to the betterment of society. Similarly, her support of labor unions was tempered by the notion of lateral progress. Addams did not advocate for collective bargaining merely to benefit those fortunate enough to be in the unions; she viewed labor unions as working toward lateral progress by improving wages, hours and working conditions for all workers.

c. Pluralism

Addams argued for the inclusion of all members of society in the institution, policies and practices that were to lead to social progress. For example, in a 1930 article, “Widening the Circle of Enlightenment” Addams contends that pluralism has an energizing impact on society and should be embraced rather than feared. In this manner, Addams was an early American theorist who saw the value of diversity. Addams suggested that by bringing their cultural heritage to the United States, immigrants kept America from becoming static. Reciprocally, immigrants benefited from engaging in the cultural heritage found in North America. For Addams, social progress demanded that all voices be heard but she believed in the power of collective intelligence to find common cause from that diversity.

Addams’ valorization of cultural diversity was so thoroughgoing that she integrated it into her pacifist arguments. In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams contends that cosmopolitan cities are a model for international peace. While not romanticizing the conflicts between groups that occur in the city, Addams draws on numerous experiences of people from different cultural heritages setting aside their differences to develop working relationships and help one another survive the challenges of urban life. Addams believed that if diverse people under the strain of Chicago’s urban blight could find a way to work together, then countries in the international community could also come to some equilibrium without violence.

Addams applied her pluralistic commitment to intellectual understanding. Hull-House welcomed speakers from a variety of political positions, whether the residents agreed with those positions or not. To foster this openness, Addams eschewed ideological ties for herself and for the Hull-House community. In this manner, although she was sympathetic to many of the arguments of socialists, anarchists, feminists and various Christian leaders, she never entirely accepted any ideological position. Demonstrating her pragmatism, she avoided political labels but variously aligned herself when it meant advancing the cause of social progress. On many occasions, Addams and Hull-House were criticized for not clearly associating themselves with an ideological camp.

d. Democracy

Addams maintained a robust definition of democracy that moved far beyond understanding it merely as a political structure. For Addams, democracy represented both a mode of living and a social morality. She viewed democracy as an acknowledgement that the lives of citizens are bound up with one another and this relationship creates a duty to understand the struggles and circumstances of fellow citizens. Reciprocity of social relations is crucial for providing citizens with the empathetic foundation necessary to energize democracy. Social settlements were experiments in the kind of democracy that Addams endeavored to promote: one of active social engagement. Addams’ definition of democracy becomes clearest in Democracy and Social Ethics where she makes two equivalencies clear. One, moral theory in the modern age must emphasize social ethics. Two, for Addams, democracy is social ethics.

Addams metaphorically described democracy as a dynamic organism that must grow with changing times in order to remain vital. In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams goes so far as to suggest that it was time that the United States’ political institutions and morality progressed. She argued that America’s founders, whom she admired, developed the Bill of Rights based upon an individual sense of morality appropriate for their era. However, Addams viewed social morality as the appropriate response to the contemporary rise of big cities along with the improvements in technology and transportation that brought so many people together. The time had come to emphasize the social relations necessary for a vibrant democracy under the current historical circumstances. Some commentators describe Addams as advocating a “social democracy,” one that emphasizes a way of being over the political structure. Addams’ valorization of democracy did not entail a static object of affection. She wanted democracy to grow and flourish which required ongoing conversation and change. In this manner, Addams never conflated her love of democracy with unabashed patriotism. Also in Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams develops the notion of “cosmic patriotism,” arguing that one’s commitment to humanity must exceed national borders.

e. Fallibilism

Another aspect of Addams’ work that differentiates it from traditional philosophic literature is its humility. Employing the experimental method of American Pragmatists, Addams described numerous ventures undertaken by the Hull-House community in the name of fostering sympathetic knowledge or lateral progress. However, Addams was not afraid to recount her errors in these efforts. For Addams, mistakes are opportunities for growth and are worth the risk of active engagement. In the process of crossing class and cultural boundaries—moving from the familiar to the unfamiliar—there are bound to be mistakes made, but if they are done in the spirit of care and with humility, then the errors are not insurmountable and have the potential to be great teachers. Time and again, the upper class, college-educated, white women who predominated the Hull-House community demonstrated their lack of cultural sensitivity only to provide Addams with an anecdote for further social analysis and an opportunity to learn from the errors. Mistakes were merely part of the pragmatist cycle of action and reflection.

Twenty Years at Hull-House recounts many of Addams’ mistakes. For example, when Starr and Addams first established the settlement, they furnished Hull-House with the trappings of the high culture with which they were familiar. Addams later regretted this approach and recognized the class alienation that fine furniture, draperies and artwork foster. She later has these items removed for simpler furnishings. In another anecdote from Twenty Years at Hull-House, Addams oversees the construction of a coffee house at Hull-House to provide working immigrants with a place to purchase nutritious food without the temptation of alcohol, as was available at local saloons. Despite bringing in modern equipment and using the latest techniques in economical and healthy food production, the coffee house proved unpopular, even with Hull-House residents. Addams came to realize that their paternalism had prevailed, once again alienating their community. Eventually, they made adjustments in the menu to local tastes and the coffee house became another successful part of the Hull-House complex, although more for its contribution to socializing than the cuisine it provided. What is interesting about these anecdotes is that Addams does not attempt to hide or put a positive spin on them. Out of sensitivity for misrepresenting the interests and positions of her neighbors, Addams describes the practice of bringing Hull-House neighbors to her presentations so that she would not be viewed simply as the outside expert attesting to her findings. In this way, mistakes served to improve her practices.

3. Themes

Addams’ pragmatist philosophy integrated experience with theory in an ongoing and dynamic dance that makes it inappropriate to separate her theories from the social issues in which she engaged. This is part of the reason that Addams’ work appears alien to those steeped in the Western tradition of philosophy, which attempts to lay claim to universal truths. Addams makes use of what feminist philosophers have described as “standpoint epistemology,” acknowledging that her philosophy is derived from a particular social, political and historical position. Her theoretical work flowed from working out tangible social issues of her day, and yet many of her themes and conclusions remain relevant for the present.

a. Peace

Perhaps no other issue took more of Addams’ time and attention in the latter part of her public career than did peace. Besides dozens of articles, she authored two books, Newer Ideals of Peace and Peace and Bread in Time of War, she also co-authored Women at The Hague, all books that directly address issues of peace. In addition, many of her other books such as The Long Road of Women’s Memory, The Second Twenty Years at Hull-House, and My Friend, Julia Lathrop have at least a chapter dedicated to issues of peace. While Addams avoided ideological positions, she came closest when it came to pacifism. Nevertheless, she never invoked a universal principle such as declaring all war as immoral, however she did contend that violent conflict was regressive, wasteful and provided the possibility of further violence in society.

In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams made it clear that she saw peace as more than the absence of war. For Addams, peace represented an opportunity for social progress because people were capable of working together to achieve social goals. Like many in the late nineteenth century, Addams viewed social evolution as progressing toward greater peaceful relations and social harmony. Collective peace was tied to individual peaceful relations such that communal activism represented peace efforts. For example, helping immigrants thrive in the United States was an act of peace. In this manner, given her commitment to democratic social progress achieved through collective engagement in an effort to foster sympathetic knowledge, Addams extrapolated that war is socially regressive. Armed conflict ends rational and dispassionate conversations impeding the agreement necessary for social growth. War makes opposing human beings into ultimate others—someone so alien that it is possible to kill them—creating the antithesis of sympathetic knowledge.

Addams resisted compartmentalizing her moral philosophy, and she extended this to her ideas about peace. Rather than merely offering a direct normative assessment of militarism, Addams casts a wider net to address variables less causally related to a particular conflict. In “Democracy or Militarism,” written in the context of the Spanish-American War, Addams indicates that society is at a crossroads. According to Addams, to accept militaristic actions as a part of international politics is to normalize brutalization that makes further violence acceptable. To support her claim, she cites instances of increased social violence that can be tied, albeit loosely, to the formal acceptance of war. Furthermore, Addams identifies the gender dimension of increased militarism. In “War Times Changing Women’s Traditions,” Addams resists traditional notions of chivalry and romanticism to claim that the ostensible argument for the violent protection of women can only lead women to a vulnerable position in a society where violence is normalized.

Addams was not merely a social critic. Her social philosophy often included alternative plans of action—not fixed solutions but flexible and revisable outcomes. Addams, like William James, suggests that militarism has been ennobled in cultural traditions and that an ennobling substitute was needed to fire the same kind of dedication. In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams offers social activism as the cause that should be rallied around. Addams challenges her readers to imagine heroism in the work of social activists to improve urban life.

Her staunch philosophy of pacifism brought Addams a great amount of personal criticism during her public career. Although many of her contemporaries, like Dewey, would support the United States’ entry into World War I, Addams did not. Her popularity suffered greatly and she faced some of her harshest rebukes as national emotions peaked prior to the onset of war. More significantly, World War I signaled a changing tide for progressivism. Political realism came to the fore, and Addams’ ideals of peace suddenly became culturally archaic. The post World War I period saw the number of social settlements dwindle and American Pragmatism experienced an extended hibernation.

b. Education

Addams viewed lifelong education as a critical component of an engaged citizenry in a vibrant democracy. To that end, Hull-House sponsored a myriad of educational projects. Addams strived to improve childhood education by working for legislation to reduce child labor, she sponsored a kindergarten at Hull-House and worked with Dewey and education pioneer Ella Flagg Young on pedagogical techniques centered upon making education more relevant for students. Extant descriptions by visitors to Hull-house describe it as permeated by children furiously involved in a myriad of activities.

In the early twentieth century, adolescence was a largely overlooked period of human development and on the occasions when young adulthood was addressed at all, it was usually conceived of as a problem. Addams, who often directed her philosophical analysis to marginalized sectors of society, took a particular interest in adolescence. In what she described as her favorite book, The Spirit of Youth and the City Streets, Addams offers an extended study of the plight of young people and through her Hull-House experiences explains to her readers the needs and challenges of this age. Accordingly, Hull-House sponsored a number of programs for adolescents including social gatherings, athletics and drama. Hull-House engaged in pioneering programs for young women’s sports and physical activity, defying social norms that claimed that exercise was inappropriate for women.

Addams’ commitment to lifelong education resulted in pioneering work in adult education. Hull-House sponsored college extension courses as well as a variety of educational opportunities for adults in the community including lectures and clubs. For example, The Plato Club offered weekly readings and discussions on philosophy, where Dewey sometimes lectured, and The Working People Social Science Club provided an opportunity for discussions of social and political philosophy. Some commentators have claimed that Hull-House was the birthplace of adult education. In The Second Twenty Years at Hull-House, Addams describes developing particular pedagogical techniques adapted for adult students including the need for a peer-level social atmosphere and the use of news events as an opportunity for learning.

c. Women’s Advancement

Addams eschewed ideological labels including that of feminist, nevertheless she was clearly aligned with the feminist movement. She advocated for women’s suffrage and took a leadership role as the Vice-President of the National American Woman Suffrage Association from 1911-1914. Consistent with her notion of lateral progress, Addams’ support for women’s advancement was framed in terms of social progress rather than principles of equality or merely advocating for an oppressed constituency. Addams contended that women brought an alternative perspective to politics and given her commitment to pluralism, alternative perspectives could only strengthen society. For example, in “If Men Were Seeking The Elective Franchise,” Addams parodies the plight of women by commenting on men’s foibles in a manner that mimicked the way men spoke of the reasons women should not be given elective franchise. She accused men of being quarrelsome as well as exhibiting misplaced values in preferring to spend money on armaments than on domestic welfare. Accordingly, Addams is sometimes accused of being a gender essentialist in the language she employed about the nature of men and women.

Addams undertook numerous projects with the empowerment of women as a goal. Hull-House itself was a unique woman-centered project. There were male residents but it was always clear that the leadership and culture of Hull-House were decidedly female. Hull-House supported immigrant mothers in their roles as primary care givers and even took the radical step of disseminating birth control information. One example of Addams’ concern for women can be seen in the creation of the Jane Club, described inTwenty Years at Hull-House. At a time when collective bargaining did not enjoy the legal protections that it does today, Addams observed that women labor union members were particularly vulnerable when it came to periods of unemployment created by strikes or lockouts. When such actions took place, single women could no longer afford rent money. This vulnerability reduced the power of the bargaining unit. Working with women labor leaders such as Mary Kenney, Addams established a workingwoman’s cooperative named the Jane Club. This cooperative ensured that all members’ rent was paid in the event of labor interruptions. Addams eventually secured funding to build housing for the Jane Club but it operated as an independent entity.

Given their commitments to pluralism, classical American philosophers have been generally more sympathetic to the plight of women than many other genres of philosophers, but Addams further sensitized their thought. Contemporary philosopher Charlene Haddock Seigfried coined the term “pragmatist feminism” to describe the fruitful intersection of American philosophy and feminist theory. Seigfried’s quintessential example of a pragmatist feminist was Jane Addams.

d. Economics

Although Addams did not write a book-length work on economics, comment on economic issues permeates her writings. Addams had much in common with socialist analysis, which was particularly popular in this rocky period of American economics. She knew and supported Eugene Debs, and engaged a number of socialist intellectuals in discussions. Given her pursuit of lateral progress, her affinity for socialism is understandable, but Addams’ aversion to antagonism did not allow her to accept the social upheaval espoused in much of the socialist rhetoric. Addams’ support of labor unions exemplified her socialistic leanings. In the formative years of labor organizing, there was a widespread belief that collective bargaining was a mediating step toward a social transformation where eventually greater control of the means of production would be gained by laborers. Addams viewed the amelioration of class differences as representing social progress and therefore supported unionization.

As a result of the Pullman Strike of 1894, Addams became involved in issues of union management relations. Although it was only five years after the opening of Hull-House, Addams had already garnered a public reputation for skilled negotiating and was enlisted to engage in mediation between railroad car workers and George Pullman, the staunch patriarch of the Pullman Palace Car Company and one of the richest men in America. Addams ultimately played a negligible role in the strike because Pullman refused to meet with her. The labor negotiation foundered and the strike ended quickly and painfully for the workers. Addams’ most important contribution was in constructing the legacy of the Pullman strike. Addams penned an eloquent and reflective account of the strike, “A Modern Lear,” in which she compared George Pullman to Shakespeare’s tragic figure, King Lear. It took nearly twenty years for “A Modern Lear” to be printed, as publishers shunned Addams’ critical analysis. Utilizing a process of sympathetic knowledge, Addams does not describe clear-cut heroes and villains in the Pullman strike, but characterizes Pullman as disconnected from his workers, much like King Lear was alienated from his daughter. For Addams, this illustrated the danger of capitalism, that economic barriers isolated people from one another. In a philosophy advocating an engaged society, such barriers retarded progress.

4. Philosophical Legacy

Although Addams has not always been included in the canon of classical American philosophy, her contemporaries, including John Dewey, William James and George Herbert Mead, publicly acknowledged Addams’ influence on their thinking. Therefore, in addition to her own corpus of work, Addams’ intellectual legacy can be found in their philosophy. Nevertheless, for much of the twentieth century, Addams was considered unoriginal and her writing was thought to be derivative of other thinkers. In the 1990’s, a renewed interest in Addams’ theoretical work developed from the feminist practice of revisiting historical boundaries that traditionally limited philosophical qualification. At the turn of the twenty-first century, Addams’ major works have come back in to print and a number of intellectual biographies have reconsidered Addams’ intellectual legacy.

In many ways, Addams took American pragmatism to a logical conclusion: social action. Pragmatists emphasize the dynamic relationship of experience and theory in the service of social advancement. Dewey, James and Mead engaged in social projects from university settings. Addams, who never had an official university appointment, although she did teach occasionally at the University of Chicago, took pragmatist theory out into society and applied it to her projects. However, in the process, she never stopped writing and thematizing her experiences, thus revising and reconsidering her theories. In this manner Addams provides one model of what it is to be a public philosopher.

5. References and Further Reading

a Primary Literature

i. Books

  • Addams, Jane. Democracy and Social Ethics. 1902. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2002. Addams’ most recognizable philosophical work. Of particular importance is the Introduction where she sets forth her concept of sympathetic knowledge.
  • Addams, Jane. Newer Ideals of Peace, New York: Macmillan, 1906. Addams extends the concept of peace to more than the absence of war.
  • Addams, Jane. The Spirit of Youth and the City Streets. 1909. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 1972. Addams breaks new ground by addressing the overlooked age of adolescence and describes youth in positive terms rather than the negative terms typical of the era.
  • Addams, Jane. Twenty Years at Hull House. 1910. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 1990. Best work to start a study of Addams. Opening chapters are autobiographical and then the book addresses the first two decades of the Hull-House community.
  • Addams, Jane. A New Conscience and an Ancient Evil. 1912. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2002. Addams addresses prostitution using a pragmatist approach that incorporates an analysis of many variables.
  • Addams, Jane. The Long Road of Woman’s Memory. 1916. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2002. Once again focusing upon a marginalized social group, Addams explores the depth of the memories of elderly immigrant women. Includes the intriguing story of the Devil Baby.
  • Addams, Jane. Peace and Bread in Time of War. 1922. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2002. Written after World War I, this work is less optimistic than Newer Ideal of Peace but addresses issues of patriotism and dissent in time of war.
  • Addams, Jane. Second Twenty Years at Hull House. New York: Macmillan, 1930. Addams addresses a variety of topics related to projects at Hull-House.
  • Addams, Jane. The Excellent Becomes the Permanent. New York: Macmillan, 1932. A unique text where Addams eulogizes twelve people including herself. Addams concludes by addressing issues of art, imagination, and memory.
  • Addams, Jane. My Friend, Julia Lathrop. 1935. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2004. Her last book-length work, Addams provides a biography of long time Hull-House resident, Julia Lathrop who went on to be the first woman head of a Federal agency (The Women’s Bureau). Although a biography of someone else, this work reveals a great deal about Addams’ values and philosophy.
  • Addams, Jane, Emily G. Balch and Alice Hamilton. Women at The Hague: The International Congress Of Women And Its Results.1915. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2003. Addams authors two chapters of this intriguing historical account of women organizing to prevent war and offer a means for lasting world peace.
  • Residents of Hull-House. Hull-House Maps and Papers. 1895. New York: Arno Press, Inc., 1970. Groundbreaking study of urban life and demographics in Chicago, which had witnessed an unprecedented influx of migrants from Western and Eastern Europe.

ii. Selected Articles

  • Addams, Jane. “Democracy or Militarism.” 1899. Central Anti-Imperialist League of Chicago, Liberty Tract I.
  • Addams, Jane. “A Function of the Social Settlement.” 1899. Reprinted in Christopher Lasch, Ed. The Social Thought of Jane Addams. Indianapolis: The Bobbs-Merrill Company, Inc., 1965.
  • Addams, Jane. “If Men Were Seeking The Elective Franchise.” 1913. Reprinted in Jean Bethke Elshtain, Ed. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Addams, Jane. “A Modern Lear.” 1912. Reprinted in, Jean Bethke Elshtain, Ed. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Addams, Jane. “The Objective Value of the Social Settlement.” 1893. Reprinted in, Jean Bethke Elshtain, Ed. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Addams, Jane. “The Subjective Necessity for Social Settlements.” 1893. Reprinted in, Jean Bethke Elshtain, Ed. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Addams, Jane. “War Times Changing Women’s Traditions.” 1916. Reprinted in Jane Addams on Peace, War, and International Understanding 1899-1932, ed., Allen F. Davis (New York: Garland Publishing, 1976), 135.
  • Addams, Jane. “Widening the Circle of Enlightenment.” 1930. Journal of Adult Education II, no. 3 (June).

iii. Collections

  • Bryan, Mary Lynn McCree, Barbara Bair, and Maree De Angury. Eds., The Selected Papers of Jane Addams Volume 1: Preparing to Lead, 1860-1881. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2003.
  • Condliffe Lagemann, Ellen. Ed., Jane Addams On Education. New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction Publishers, 1994.
  • Cooper Johnson, Emily. Ed., Jane Addams: A Centennial Reader. New York: Macmillan, 1960.
  • Davis, Allen F. Ed., Jane Addams on Peace, War, and International Understanding. New York: Garland Publishing, Inc., 1976.
  • Elshtain, Jean Bethke. Ed., The Jane Addams Reader. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Lasch, Christopher. Ed., The Social Thought of Jane Addams. Indianapolis: The Bobbs-Merrill Company Inc., 1965.

b. Secondary Literature

  • Deegan, Mary Jo. Jane Addams and the Men of the Chicago School, 1892-1918. New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction Books, 1988. Through numerous articles and books, Deegan has spearheaded an effort to have Addams recognized as one of the most important American sociologists.
  • Fischer, Marilyn. On Addams. Wadsworth, 2004. The most concise review of Addams’ philosophy. A handy companion volume to Addams’ writings.
  • Hamington, Maurice. Embodied Care: Jane Addams, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, and Feminist Ethics. Urbana, Il: University of Illinois Press, 2004. Addams’ work conceived as contributing to feminist care ethics.
  • Seigfried, Charlene Haddock, Pragmatism and Feminism: Reweaving the Social Fabric. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1996. Seigfried suggests that pragmatism and feminism have much in common and can benefit from further integration. Addams exemplifies a pragmatist feminist position.

c. Biographies

  • Brown, Victoria Bissell. The Education of Jane Addams. Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press, 2004.
  • Davis, Allen F. American Heroine: The Life and Legend of Jane Addams. London: Oxford, 1973.
  • Diliberto, Gioia. A Useful Woman: The Early Life of Jane Addams. New York: Scribner, 1999.
  • Elshtain, Jean Bethke. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Farrell, John C. Beloved Lady: A History of Jane Addams’ Ideas on Reform and Peace. Baltimore: The John Hopkins Press, 1967.
  • Joslin, Katherine, Jane Addams: A Writer’s Life. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2004.
  • Knight, Louise, Citizen: Jane Addams and the Struggle for Democracy. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2005.
  • Linn, James Weber. Jane Addams: A Biography. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2000.

Author Information

Maurice Hamington
Lane Community College
U. S. A.

Political Philosophy of Alasdair MacIntyre

Alasdair MacIntyreThis article focuses on Alasdair MacIntyre’s contribution to political philosophy since 1981, although MacIntyre has also written influential works on theology, Marxism, rationality, metaphysics, ethics, and the history of philosophy. He has made a personal intellectual journey from Marxism to Catholicism and from Aristotle to Aquinas, and he is one of the preeminent Thomist political philosophers. The most consistent and most distinctive feature of MacIntyre's work is his antipathy to the modern liberal capitalist world. He believes that modern philosophy and modern life are characterized by the absence of any coherent moral code, and that the vast majority of individuals living in this world lack a meaningful sense of purpose in their lives and also lack any genuine community. He draws on the ideal of the Greek polis and Aristotle's philosophy to propose a different way of life in which people work together in genuinely political communities to acquire the virtues and fulfill their innately human purpose. This way of life is to be sustained in small communities which are to resist as best they can the destructive forces of liberal capitalism.

It is important to keep in mind that MacIntyre is not suggesting that we should merely tinker around the edges of liberal capitalist society; his goal is to fundamentally transform it. He does not believe that this will happen quickly or easily, and indeed it may not happen at all, but he believes that it will be a disaster for humanity if it does not happen. After Virtue famously closes with a warning about "the new dark ages which are already upon us" (After Virtue 263). It is also important to keep in mind that even if, after careful consideration, you do not agree with MacIntyre's proposed solution, or you do not believe that it has any chance of actually coming about, it may still be that MacIntyre's critique of the modern world is at least partially correct. MacIntyre is well aware that most of us who have been brought up in the liberal capitalist world see our world's ideas and institutions as natural and desirable – not perfect, but fundamentally sound – and so we will not easily be persuaded that it is in fact inherently deeply flawed and profoundly unhealthy. But an openness to that possibility is essential to understanding MacIntyre.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Philosophy and Society
  3. The Current Moral Disorder and Its Consequences
  4. The Absence of Meaningful Moral Choices
  5. Emotivism and Manipulative Social Relations
  6. The Concept of a Practice and the Origin of the Virtues
  7. Politics in a World without Morality
  8. The Greek Way of Life
  9. Heroic Society and Homer
  10. The Athenian Polis and Aristotle
  11. Our Human Nature: Dependent Rational Animals and Human Virtues
  12. A New Politics
  13. A New Economics
  14. Conclusion
  15. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

Alasdair MacIntyre was born in 1929, in Glasgow, Scotland. He holds MA degrees from the University of Manchester and University College at Oxford, and taught at several institutions in the United Kingdom before moving to the United States in 1970. He has taught at several institutions in the United States, and he currently holds a position at Notre Dame University.

His first publication, "Analogy in Metaphysics," appeared in 1950 when he was 21 years old. His first book, Marxism: An Interpretation, followed in 1953. Since then, he has written or edited nearly twenty books and hundreds of articles and book reviews on a wide range of subjects, including theology, Marxism, the nature of rationality, metaphysics, and the history of philosophy and ethics. For references that deal with his contributions to fields other than political philosophy, and for more detailed biographical information, see the References and Further Reading.

This essay concentrates on MacIntyre's contributions to political philosophy and is primarily concerned with his best known work, After Virtue, which was originally published in 1981. A second edition of After Virtue was published in 1984; it included a postscript in which MacIntyre responded to a number of criticisms of the original edition. It is this second edition that will be cited below. The three main works which followed After Virtue expand on, clarify, or revise the arguments found there. These are Whose Justice? Which Rationality? (1988), Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry (1990), and Dependent Rational Animals (1999). The last is of particular importance for understanding the practical consequences of MacIntyre's political philosophy. It is also likely to be the easiest of the three for the beginning student of MacIntyre's work to read and understand. A useful source for MacIntyre's thought is The MacIntyre Reader (1998), edited by Kelvin Knight, which brings together a number of MacIntyre's shorter works going back to the 1950s, a pair of interviews with MacIntyre, excerpts from After Virtue and Whose Justice? Which Rationality?, and two thoughtful essays by Knight.

In the first of those essays, Knight claims that "MacIntyre's politics may now, to an extent, be described in terms of resistance" (The MacIntyre Reader 23; see also Breen 2002 and McMylor 1994). Knight is certainly right about this. MacIntyre is trying to resist and transform essentially the entire modern world. His definition of "modern" stretches back roughly 350 years to the Enlightenment, although he considers the Enlightenment to have been a mistake; (After Virtue 118 and Chapters 4-6; see also Whose Justice? Which Rationality? Chapter 1), but in this article the term "modern" will mean the contemporary twentieth and twenty-first century world.

MacIntyre wants to overthrow the liberal capitalist ideology that currently dominates the world both in the realm of ideas and in its manifestations in political and social institutions and actions. He seeks to achieve this not through the use of force but by changing how people think about, understand, and act in the world. To show that the changes he wants are possible and desirable, he returns to an older conception of morality, derived from the teachings of St. Thomas Aquinas and ultimately, through Aquinas, the philosophy of Aristotle and the way of life of the Athenian polis. He portrays this older conception of morality as both superior to and fundamentally hostile to the modern order, and his philosophical arguments are meant to help restore it to the world. On the other hand, he understands that liberal capitalism has tremendous power and appeal both in the world of ideas and in the power it has over people in the social, political, and economic spheres. Ultimately his recommendation is that the particular conditions of the modern world require that those who agree with his arguments should, to the greatest possible degree, withdraw from the world into communities where the old morality can be kept alive until the time is right for it to re-emerge.

This article begins by describing the modern world as MacIntyre sees it, and then moves on to MacIntyre's depiction of what he believes to be the very different world of the ancient Greeks, and specifically the ancient Athenians. Next, it contrasts the two and shows why MacIntyre believes the ancient world to be superior. The conclusion examines MacIntyre's suggested alternative to the modern world, which draws on the ancient world without simply proposing a return to it.

It is important to keep in mind that MacIntyre is not suggesting that we should merely tinker around the edges of liberal capitalist society; his goal is to fundamentally transform it. He does not believe that this will happen quickly or easily, and indeed it may not happen at all, but he believes that it will be a disaster for humanity if it does not happen. After Virtue famously closes with a warning about "the new dark ages which are already upon us" (After Virtue 263). It is also important to keep in mind that even if, after careful consideration, you do not agree with MacIntyre's proposed solution, or you do not believe that it has any chance of actually coming about, it may still be that MacIntyre's critique of the modern world is at least partially correct. MacIntyre is well aware that most of us who have been brought up in the liberal capitalist world see our world's ideas and institutions as natural and desirable – not perfect, but fundamentally sound – and so we will not easily be persuaded that it is in fact inherently deeply flawed and profoundly unhealthy. But an openness to that possibility is essential to understanding MacIntyre.

2. Philosophy and Society

As we work through MacIntyre's argument, we will be talking about both the world of ideas – that is, philosophy – and the world of institutions and actions – that is, politics and society. Although at times we will consider these two worlds separately, one of MacIntyre's most strongly held convictions is that they are closely connected. MacIntyre has not always been clear or consistent about the strength or direction of that connection, but the importance of the connection for MacIntyre's argument has been consistent ever since After Virtue. Contemporary philosophers, he says, tend to interpret and argue about the works of past philosophers without paying attention to the intellectual and especially the social context in which those works were created. They act as though all past philosophers are contributing to the same argument, seeking timeless and eternal moral truths. But this is wrong, because philosophies are in large part derived from sociologies and are specific to particular societies: "Morality which is no particular society's morality is to be found nowhere" (After Virtue 265-266; see also The MacIntyre Reader 258). Although philosophers can and should learn from the work of earlier philosophers, this is not their main source of ideas when they are doing their job properly. What philosophers primarily do is study the actual world in which they live – its politics, traditions, social organization, families and so on – and try to find the ideas and values that must underlie those institutions and practices, even if the members of the society cannot articulate them, or cannot articulate them fully. When the philosophers have done their work correctly, the philosophy they articulate will reflect their society; and because philosophers are uniquely suited to see the society as a whole they will be in a unique position to point out inconsistencies, propose new ideas consistent with the old ones that are nevertheless improvements on those ideas, and show why things that seem trivial are actually crucial to the society, and vice versa. They are also in a position to examine not only what it is that the people in their society do but why they do it, even when those people cannot explain it for themselves. These are the things that MacIntyre himself wants to do: show the inconsistencies and incoherencies at the center of modern conceptions of morality and society and transform them so that the modern expression of morality, structure of society, and practices of politics can be transformed as well. But philosophers do not and cannot stand outside of all societies to offer objective truths or objective moralities, since these must always be connected to particular societies.

So, the political, social, and economic life of a society constrains the kinds of ideas and morality it can have (at times MacIntyre seems to agree with Marx that these things do not merely constrain ideas and morals but actually determine them), and those ideas and that morality, especially as articulated by philosophers, in turn influence economics and politics (again, in different writings MacIntyre seems to have different views about how much influence they have). Let us see what MacIntyre has to say about modern ideas and institutions in After Virtue.

3. The Current Moral Disorder and Its Consequences

MacIntyre begins After Virtue by asking the reader to engage in a thought experiment: "Imagine that the natural sciences were to suffer the effects of a catastrophe…. A series of environmental disasters [which] are blamed by the general public on the scientists" leads to rioting, scientists being lynched by angry mobs, the destruction of laboratories and equipment, the burning of books, and ultimately the decision by the government to end science instruction in schools and universities and to imprison and execute the remaining scientists. Eventually, enlightened people decide to restore science, but what do they have to work with? Only fragments: bits and pieces of theories, chapters of books, torn and charred pages of articles, hazy memories and damaged equipment with functions that are unclear, if not entirely forgotten. These people, he argues, would combine these fragments as best they could, inventing theories to connect them as necessary. People would talk and act as though they were doing "science," but they would actually be doing something very different from what we currently call science. From our point of view, in a world where the sciences are intact, their "science" would be full of errors and inconsistencies, "truths" which no one could actually prove, and competing theories which were incompatible with one another. Further, the supporters of these theories would be unable to agree on any way to resolve their differences.

Why does MacIntyre ask us to imagine such a world? "The hypothesis I wish to advance is that in the actual world which we inhabit the language of morality is in the same state of grave disorder as the language of natural science in the imaginary world which I described" (After Virtue 2, After Virtue 256). People in the modern liberal capitalist world talk as though we are engaged in moral reasoning, and act as though our actions are chosen as the result of such reasoning, but in fact neither of these things is true. Just as with the people working with "science" in the imaginary world that MacIntyre describes, philosophers and ordinary people are working today with bits and pieces of philosophies which are detached from their original pre-Enlightenment settings in which they were comprehensible and useful. Current moral and political philosophies are fragmented, incoherent, and conflicting, with no standards that can be appealed to in order to evaluate their truth or adjudicate the conflicts between them – or at least no standards that all those involved in the disputes will be willing to accept, since any standard will presuppose the truth of one of the contending positions. To use an analogy that MacIntyre does not use, one might say that it is as if we tore handfuls of pages from books by Jane Austen, Shakespeare, Danielle Steele, Mark Twain, and J.K. Rowling, threw half of them away, shuffled the rest, stapled them together, and then tried to read the "story" that resulted. It would be incoherent, and any attempt to describe the characters, plot, or meaning would be doomed to failure. On the other hand, because certain characters, settings, and bits of narrative would reappear throughout, it would seem as though the story could cohere, and much effort – ultimately futile – might be expended in trying to make it do so. This, according to MacIntyre, is the moral world in which we currently live.

One consequence of this situation is that we have endless and interminable debates within philosophy and, where philosophy influences politics, within politics as well (After Virtue 6-8, Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry 7 and Chapter 1). MacIntyre demonstrates this with regard to philosophers by a comparison of the positions of John Rawls and Robert Nozick on what justice is, positions which are mutually exclusive, but internally coherent. Each conclusion follows reasonably from its premises (After Virtue Chapter 17). Each position has many adherents who can point out the flaws in the other but cannot successfully defend their own position against attack. In the political world, one of the examples MacIntyre uses is the abortion issue in the United States. One side of the debate, drawing largely on a particular interpretation of Christian ethics, asserts that abortion is murder and hence is both morally unacceptable and deserving of legal punishment; the other side, usually drawing either on a conception of privacy or of rights or both, asserts that women should have the right to make a private decision about terminating a pregnancy, and therefore abortion, while possibly morally problematic, deserves the protection of the law. In either case, the conclusion follows logically, that is, reasonably, from the premises. But the starting premises are incompatible, and there is no way to gain everyone's agreement to either set of premises, nor is there even any agreement on what kind of argument might be able to gain a consensus. (And a look at public opinion polls about abortion taken in the United States shows that the percentage of people for or against legal abortion in particular circumstances has basically remained unchanged since Roe v. Wade was decided in 1973).

It is also the case, according to MacIntyre, that those involved in these philosophical and political debates claim to be using premises that are objective, based on reason, and universally applicable. Many of them even believe these claims, misunderstanding the nature of their particular inadequate modern philosophy, just as the people in MacIntyre's post-disaster world misunderstand what it means to be doing real science. But what they are really doing, whether they recognize it or not, is using the language of morality to try to gain their own preferences. They are not trying to persuade others by reasoned argument, because a reasoned argument about morality would require a shared agreement on the good for human beings in the same way that reasoned arguments in the sciences rely on shared agreement about what counts as a scientific definition and a scientific practice. This agreement about the good for human beings does not exist in the modern world (in fact, the modern world is in many ways defined by its absence) and so any attempt at reasoned argument about morality or moral issues is doomed to fail. Other parties to the argument are fully aware that they are simply trying to gain the outcome they prefer using whatever methods happen to be the most effective. (Below there will be more discussion of these people; they are the ones who tend to be most successful as the modern world measures success.) Because we cannot agree on the premises of morality or what morality should aim at, we cannot agree about what counts as a reasoned argument, and since reasoned argument is impossible, all that remains for any individual is to attempt to manipulate other people's emotions and attitudes to get them to comply with one's own wishes.

MacIntyre claims that protest and indignation are hallmarks of public "debate" in the modern world. Since no one can ever win an argument – because there's no agreement about how someone could "win" – anyone can resort to protesting; since no one can ever lose an argument – how can they, if no one can win? – anyone can become indignant if they don't get their way. If no one can persuade anyone else to do what they want, then only coercion, whether open or hidden (for example, in the form of deception) remains. This is why, MacIntyre says, political arguments are not just interminable but extremely loud and angry, and why modern politics is simply a form of civil war.

4. The Absence of Meaningful Moral Choices

But there is another problem. Just as no one can win an argument with anyone else by persuading them with reasons, no one can win such an argument with himself or herself in trying to determine what their own moral commitments should be. In other words, no one can have real reasons for choosing the moral positions and values that they do, and no one can have any real reasons for choosing any way of life over any other as the best possible life. So any choice about the kind of life one will lead (and of course these choices have to be made, either consciously or unconsciously) must be arbitrary; any individual could always just as easily have chosen some other life which would have a very different set of moral positions and values (After Virtue Chapter 4). And if I can choose to be anything, but have no way of discovering reasons that might persuade me that some choice is the best, then it is impossible for me to make any kind of meaningful commitment to any of my choices, and it will be extremely easy to revise my morals in the name of expediency. The temptation will therefore be strong to choose moral principles on the grounds of effectiveness. I will choose my values at any given time because they happen to be useful as a way of attaining something else I value, rather than rationally choosing the best possible life and then letting that choice of the best life determine what I should value and what I should do. Perhaps I will choose values that enable me to be more popular in my community, or values that are useful for justifying my desire for money, or values that I believe will make me more successful at my job. What most people cannot do and are not even aware that they should do is tie their moral positions to a coherent and defensible version of the good life for human beings. The modern philosophies that have received the most attention and support – theories of utility such as those put forward by Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill, and theories of rights such as those advanced by John Locke and John Rawls – cannot provide such a description of the good life for human beings, and MacIntyre regards them as having failed in their ambitions to do so and therefore to have failed in their project of creating new moral systems even on their own terms (After Virtue Chapter 6).

Many would disagree with MacIntyre at this point. They would say that these moral debates are interminable not because of anything specific to modernity but because by their nature they do not and cannot have any resolution. In their view, the situation MacIntyre has described is not a sign of philosophical or political failure in modern times, it is simply a recognition that there are many diverse definitions of what the best life for human beings is and therefore what is just, or good, or virtuous, and that while many of them are legitimate, none is or can be absolutely true. It follows that each of us is entitled to our own viewpoint on these matters and to choose the version of the best life and the best moral code that we individually prefer, provided of course we do not harm others. In After Virtue, MacIntyre calls this point of view emotivism, "the doctrine that all evaluative judgments and more specifically all moral judgments are nothing but expressions of preference, expressions of attitude or feeling, insofar as they are moral or evaluative in character" (After Virtue 11-12, emphasis in original). In a world where people subscribe to emotivism, moral judgments, since they cannot be used for reasoned persuasion, are used for two reasons: to express our own preferences, and to try to change the emotions and attitudes of those with whom we disagree in order to make them agree with us and share our preferences. MacIntyre believes that emotivism is a false doctrine, because we can in fact rationally determine the best possible life for human beings and therefore can have moral judgments that are more than mere preferences, but it is nevertheless a doctrine that many people today subscribe to, and they act as though it is true. Because so many people act as if it is true, it takes on a degree of power in the world. This is one example of the linkage between how people think and how they live: "A moral philosophy – and emotivism is no exception – characteristically presupposes a sociology" (After Virtue 23; see also Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry 80). Although few people would, if asked, say that they subscribed to the doctrine of emotivism (indeed, few people would even be able to explain what it is), it is only possible to make sense of their actions and lives if we say that they are acting according to emotivist principles – they act as though morality is nothing but an arbitrary choice that is an expression of their will, and so this is the doctrine to which we can say they subscribe.

5. Emotivism and Manipulative Social Relations

If we are to fully understand emotivism as a philosophical doctrine, MacIntyre says, we must understand what it would look like if it were socially embodied. That is, if we stipulate that nearly all the people in a given society subscribe to emotivism, what can we expect their society look like? How will they behave? It turns out, MacIntyre says, that such a society would look much like ours, and that (as has been said) we act as though we believe emotivism to be true. MacIntyre says that "the key to the social content of the fact that emotivism entails the obliteration of any genuine distinction between manipulative and non-manipulative social relations" (After Virtue 23). Each of us regards the other members of our society as means to ends of our own. Because I cannot persuade people, and because we cannot have any common good that is not purely temporary and based on our separate individual desires, there is no kind of social relationship left except for each of us trying to use the others to achieve our own selfish goals. Even for someone who did not want to live this way, the fact that others would be trying to gain power over them in order to manipulate them would mean that they would still need to seek as much power as they could simply to avoid being manipulated. It would also mean that each of them would need to manipulate others in ways that would make it more difficult or impossible for them to be manipulated in return. This is similar to the argument that animates a good deal of Hobbes' Leviathan, where the constant battle for power over one another in a state of nature leads to a life that is solitary, poor, nasty, brutish, and short, and eventually to the recognition of the need for a sovereign with absolute power – although this, of course, is not the solution MacIntyre advocates.

6. The Concept of a Practice and the Origin of the Virtues

In After Virtue, MacIntyre tries to explain another element of what is missing in modern life through his use of the concept of a practice. He illustrates this with the example of a person wishing to teach a disinterested child how to play chess.

The teaching process may begin with the teacher offering the child candy to play and enough additional candy if the child wins to motivate the child to play. It might be assumed that this is sufficient to motivate the child to learn to play chess well, but as MacIntyre notes, it is sufficient only to motivate the child to learn to win – which may mean cheating if the opportunity arises. However, over time, the child may come to appreciate the unique combination of skills and abilities that chess calls on, and may learn to enjoy exercising and developing those skills and abilities. At this point, the child will be interested in learning to play chess well for its own sake. Cheating to win will, from this point on, be a form of losing, not winning, because the child will be denying themselves the true rewards of chess playing, which are internal to the game. The child will also, it should be noted, enjoy playing chess; there is pleasure associated with developing one's skills and abilities that cannot come if one cheats in order to win.

MacIntyre concludes that there are two kinds of goods attached to the practice of chess-playing and to practices in general. One kind, external goods, are goods attached to the practice "by the accidents of social circumstance" – in his example, the candy given to the child, but in the real world typically money, power, and fame (After Virtue 188). These can be achieved in any number of ways. Internal goods are the goods that can only be achieved by participating in the practice itself. If you want the benefits to be gained by playing chess, you will have to play chess. And in pursuing them while playing chess, you gain other goods as well – you will get an education in the virtues. The two kinds of goods differ as well in that external goods end up as someone's property, and the more one person has of any of them the less there is for anyone else (money, power, and fame are often of this nature). Internal goods are competed for as well, "but it is characteristic of them that their achievement is a good for the whole community who participate in the practice" (After Virtue 190-191). A well played chess game benefits both the winner and loser, and the community as a whole can learn from the play of the game and develop their own skills and talents by learning from it.

MacIntyre believes that politics should be a practice with internal goods, but as it is now it only leads to external goods. Some win, others lose; there is no good achieved that is good for the whole community; cheating and exploitation are frequent, and this damages the community as a whole. (MacIntyre has changed his terminology since After Virtue. He now calls internal goods "goods of excellence," and external goods are now called "goods of effectiveness." See The MacIntyre Reader 55).

One important way to understand the community surrounding a genuine practice is as a community of teachers and learners, with each individual community member filling each of these roles at different times. "It belongs to the concept of a practice as I have outlined it…that its goods can only be achieved by subordinating ourselves within the practice in our relationship to other practitioners " (After Virtue 191). Throughout my time as a participant in a practice, but especially at the beginning, I must put myself under the authority of others. To continue MacIntyre's example of chess playing beyond where he develops it, notice that I, the player, rely on other chess players to teach me rules and strategies, to evaluate my play and suggest improvements, answer questions, encourage and guide me, and provide opponents. In competing with one another, we develop one another's skills, and each of us is able to recognize and value those skills in the other and hence values the other person for exhibiting those skills.

MacIntyre notes that when individuals first start to engage in a practice, they have no choice but to agree to accept external standards for the evaluation of their performance and to agree to follow the rules set out for the practice: "A practice involves standards of excellence and obedience to rules as well as the achievement of goods" (After Virtue 190). As a newcomer, I lack the knowledge and experience that would let me evaluate myself and my efforts, so I must rely on others to judge me according to the standards of the practice. And I cannot simply subordinate the standards to my will; I cannot simply decide that I am a grand master at chess because I want to be one. The standards that determine who is and who is not a grand master are already established, and I must accept them. Unilaterally declaring myself a grand master will not place me at the top of the chess hierarchy; it will place me outside it altogether. As I gain in talent, experience, and knowledge, I can begin to have input into the standards themselves, but I will never gain the ability to move outside them if I want to continue to participate in the practice. Nor will I ever gain the ability to move outside the rules if I want to be part of the practice, although in some cases the community can agree to change the rules if they believe it is beneficial to the practice. So, for example, the rules of chess have changed since the game's origin, and MacIntyre would likely say that this has happened in order to more fully develop the principles of the game.

MacIntyre also emphasizes that chess, like other practices, has a history and is part of a tradition. So he might point out that an important part of becoming a grand master at chess is studying the records of games that have been played by previous grand masters, reading commentaries on those games, examining their philosophies, practice regimens, and the psychological tactics they employed on their opponents, and so on. The rules and standards have developed in the past and are binding on the present, and although they can sometimes be changed by the community as a whole those changes should be consistent with the principles of the game as it has developed in the past. This would seem to be a very conservative doctrine, as it is in the hands of someone like Edmund Burke (cf. Reflections on the Revolution in France), but MacIntyre is explicit that traditions that are in good order require ongoing internal debates about the meaning of the tradition and how it is to be improved and developed for the future. He is not advocating blind loyalty to the past, nor is he saying that all change is bad. He is only acknowledging that the present rests on the past and must take that past into account in its self-understanding as well as in its planning for the future. We have already mentioned changes in the rules of chess, but other transformations can occur without changing the rules. Today, for example, chess players may decide that they must revise what they know about the game and how it is played in order to compete against computer opponents which use very different methods of playing than human opponents do. This requires new approaches and tactics which will become part of the tradition that is available to players in the future. But developing new methods does not require starting from scratch – the past provides materials for use in the present and should not be dismissed as irrelevant.

Although MacIntyre does not emphasize this, he likely would agree with Burke that the idea that one is part of a tradition can serve to strengthen the community, as it encourages the present practitioners to think of themselves as tied to the past and with an obligation to the future, so that they will work to surpass the standards of the past and leave a tradition that is in good order to those who will practice it in the future.

Practices are also important because it is only within the context of a practice that human beings can practice the virtues. Goods that are external to practices, such as money and power, can be achieved in a variety of ways, some good and some bad. But achieving the goods that are internal to a practice, according to MacIntyre, requires the presence of the , and in After Virtue he defines the virtues in terms of practices: "A virtue is an acquired human quality the possession and the exercise of which tends to enable us to achieve those goods which are internal to practices and the lack of which effectively prevents us from achieving any such goods….we have to accept as necessary components of any practice with internal goods and standards of excellence the virtues of justice, courage, and honesty" (After Virtue 191). The necessity of these virtues follows logically from the definition of a practice, as we shall see, but it is important to understand that as far as MacIntyre is concerned, virtues and therefore morality can only make sense in the context of a practice: they require a shared end, shared rules, and shared standards of evaluation. The virtues also define the relationships among those who share a practice: "….the virtues are those goods by reference to which, whether we like it or not, we define our relationships to those other people with whom we share the kind of purposes and standards which inform practices" (After Virtue 191). We must have the virtues if we are to have healthy practices and healthy communities. Let us consider the three virtues of honesty, courage, and justice and see how they arise from practices.

Members of a practice must be honest with each other when they instruct others in the principles of the practice, when they explain the rules to them, and when they evaluate their performance. And we have already seen that the practitioners must not lie or cheat when they engage in the practice, or they will not really be engaging in it and will not gain the benefits of doing so. Courage, MacIntyre says, is a virtue "because the care and concern for individuals, communities and causes which is so crucial to so much in practices requires the existence of such a virtue" (After Virtue 192). Practitioners of a shared practice come to genuinely care about each other, and genuinely caring about others means a willingness to risk harm or danger on their behalf, and that is what courage is. Finally, "Justice requires that we treat others in respect of merit or desert according to uniform and impersonal standards," and we have seen that these are the standards that are a part of a practice (After Virtue 192). So virtues such as honesty, courage, and justice have meaning in the context of a practice, raising the possibility that there is a way out of the moral chaos that surrounds us today.

MacIntyre is vague about what things do and do not constitute practices; he gives some examples of each, stating that playing chess is a practice but playing tic-tac-toe isn't; farming is, but planting turnips isn't. More important to him than narrowly defining the boundaries of a practice is arguing that particular kinds of activities certainly are practices. Why does MacIntyre care so much about practices? It is because he believes that there are a number of things that have been practices in the past, currently are not, but could (and should) be again, and chief among these is politics. It is possible to think of politics as a practice within a community that has a shared aim, and where the members of that community have the same standards of excellence, the same rules, and the same traditions. Indeed, in MacIntyre's view, politics is a sort of meta-practice, because it is the practice of determining the best life for human beings, a life which will include engaging in other practices. Here MacIntyre parallels Aristotle's language about politics as the science ordering the other sciences (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics I.2). The benefits of a practice would then flow to those who participated in politics – in fact, certain important benefits could only be achieved by political participation – and politics would make people more virtuous rather than less virtuous as it now does. To see why politics currently makes people worse instead of better, and how this inevitably follows from our current moral anarchy, we need to take a closer look at contemporary politics.

7. Politics in a World without Morality

MacIntyre argues that today we live in a fragmented society made up of individuals who have no conception of the human good, no way to come together to pursue a common good, no way to persuade one another about what that common good might be, and indeed most of us believe that the common good does not and cannot exist. What kind of politics can such a society have? "Politically the societies of advanced Western modernity are oligarchies disguised as liberal democracies. The large majority of those who inhabit them are excluded from membership in the elites that determine the range of alternatives between which voters are permitted to choose. And the most fundamental issues are excluded from that range of alternatives.” (The MacIntyre Reader 237; see also The MacIntyre Reader 248, 272). What MacIntyre means by "the most fundamental issues" are the issues of what the best way of life is for individual human beings and for human communities as a whole, and how each can be ordered so as to enable the other to flourish. Modern politics has no space for such issues. Prior to the 2004 election in the United States he published a short essay on the Internet arguing that in light of this lack of meaningful alternatives about the most fundamental issues the proper thing to do was refrain from voting. There are no meaningful alternatives on these issues because almost all citizens subscribe, consciously or not, to the modern idea that issues about the best way of life are not capable of political resolution or consensus and that they must be left to each individual to decide. MacIntyre and other critics of liberalism, which they see as the political manifestation of emotivism, argue that liberalism claims to be neutral about the best way of life and moves debates about it out of the public sphere and into the private, claiming that the state should take no position about what the good life or the good state is. This however has the effect of privileging a certain kind of life and a certain kind of state in the name of neutrality; it is another of the deceptions of the modern world. Because liberalism asserts that each individual has a right to pursue happiness in his or her own way, and because the versions of happiness individuals pursue are inevitably mutually incompatible (I wish to have prayer in schools, you do not; I wish to outlaw abortion, which you support; I wish to raise taxes on the wealthy to feed the poor, which you reject), and because we cannot persuade one another or agree on a common good, politics is, as MacIntyre says, "civil war carried on by other means" (After Virtue 253).

MacIntyre's famous comment, quoted earlier, about the new dark ages we are living in is followed by the observation that in contrast to the earlier dark ages, the barbarians are not at the gates but in fact have been governing us for some time (After Virtue 263). This conclusion is what we would expect if MacIntyre's view of the world is right. We would be ruled by people who are ruthlessly aggressive, ignorant of or actually hostile to the virtues required for civilized life, and destructive of social life. Since politics today is about using ideas and arguments not to search for truth but to manipulate others in the quest for power, we would expect the people with the most power to be the ones who are best at manipulating others for their own purposes and who have the greatest desire for power. The reasons they would give to justify their power would be false, but widely accepted, and they would use that power for their own selfish ends. Furthermore, they would pursue that power through whatever means they felt would be most effective, in the absence of any of the standards of right and wrong or success and failure that a practice would provide. In such a world, MacIntyre says, things that would appear to be vices would in fact be virtues. For example, keeping one's word, which as we have already seen MacIntyre considers to be one of the most important virtues (it is part of honesty), would frequently have negative consequences for those who practiced it, since it might end up being an obstacle to achieving some goal most effectively. So instead of condemning people for not keeping their word, we praise them for the virtue of "adaptability" and the ability to change as the situation demands it. If politics were a practice with the possibility of internal goods and virtues, this would not be the case; but since it is currently not a practice, and therefore has only external goods to offer, it is. Anyone who has read The Prince cannot read MacIntyre on this point without recalling Machiavelli's advice to the prince about the need to be adaptable and the only relevant standards being those of success or failure; MacIntyre would certainly agree that the modern world is characterized by its Machiavellian politics.

It would also be in the interest of the ruling elite that would arise that no one raises any of the fundamental questions about the best life for human beings and the community considered earlier, because any answer to those questions, and indeed any attempt to find answers, could only undermine the legitimacy of their rule which is based on the belief that there are no such answers. MacIntyre says in After Virtue that claims to rule are based on the claim to possess bureaucratic competence as described by Max Weber: people claim that they should have power because they are the ones that can use it most effectively, although the goals that they are pursuing in such an effective fashion are never questioned or discussed. MacIntyre further believes that these claims of managerial competence are and must be false; they are another of the deceptions of the modern age (After Virtue Chapter 6-8). But even if these claims were valid, valuing the effective use of power without considering the ends for which it is being used is a mistake. Trying to answer questions about the proper ends of human life not only reveals the nature of our current problems and the responsibility of those in power for creating and perpetuating them but it also leads to the realization that the world needs radical change before it can even be possible to discover the answers.

MacIntyre argues that modern politics has no place for patriotism, because there is no patria, or fatherland. Although there can be nationalism, jingoism, and propaganda, there can be no genuine, healthy affection for the nation or for our fellow citizens because we lack a shared project that would connect us to the nation or to our fellow citizens. It would be bizarre for people to have a feeling of attachment to the modern state, since it is bound to thwart many of their projects, allows them no effective voice, and gives them no unifying vision of the good life or any kind of shared community. And if the state is purely instrumental, to be used to advance one's own projects, why would anyone be willing to die for it, since death means the end of all such projects? Yet the state requires such a patriotic attachment, because it needs people willing to serve as soldiers, police officers, and in other similar life- and safety-threatening jobs. In trying to create such an attachment, the state reveals its own nature and its absurdity: "The modern state…behaves part of the time towards those subjected to it as if it were no more than a giant, monopolistic utility company and part of the time as if it were the sacred guardian of all that is most to be valued. In the one capacity it requires us to fill in the appropriate forms in triplicate. In the other, it periodically demands that we die for it" (The MacIntyre Reader 227; see also The MacIntyre Reader 236).

Finally, in addition to these political problems, the modern age is also characterized by global capitalism, which in MacIntyre's view has its own deeply pernicious consequences. First, it reinforces emotivism by making the pursuit of one's preferences the highest good. By doing so, it is like emotivism in that it promotes a false view of human happiness. We will see shortly what MacIntyre sees as the truly happy human life, or at least the potentially happy life, which is lived according to the objective standards of virtue found within a tradition. But we can say here that that life does not involve simply accumulating money or the things that money can buy. Money has a role to play in the virtuous life; there are certain virtues, such as generosity, which are impossible or at least very difficult to carry out without money – here MacIntyre agrees with Aristotle. But a life spent pursuing money is a wasted life, as far as MacIntyre is concerned.

Second, capitalism as an ideology also promotes the instrumental manipulation of people we have already discussed. The capitalist manager manipulates their employees in the production of goods, and the marketing department manipulates customers in order to get them to consume those goods. Free market economies "in fact ruthlessly impose market conditions that forcibly deprive many workers of productive work, that condemn parts of the labor force in metropolitan countries and whole societies in less developed areas to irremediable economic deprivation, that enlarge inequalities and divisions of wealth and income, so organizing societies into competing and antagonistic interests" (The MacIntyre Reader 249). And it is money that dominates the modern politics that is constructed by this capitalist competition and antagonism (Dependent Rational Animals 131). Money and the harm it does to the political process will not be removed from politics until people choose to pursue goods of excellence rather than goods of effectiveness. Capitalism is therefore not only harmful in and of itself but also for its effects on politics.

8. The Greek Way of Life

Given his abiding interest in and admiration for the polis, it would not be surprising if MacIntyre has another meaning for "barbarians" when he describes the people who rule us today: for the ancient Greeks, anyone who did not live in a polis and participate in polis life was a barbarian, and when we see what MacIntyre thinks the polis was and what kind of life pursued there, we will see that the people who are on top in the world today are very far from living that kind of life – as, of course, we all are. So he is probably using the word as it was originally used, in addition to using it for its modern meaning. Overcoming the modern barbarians would mean creating and defending a modern version of the polis – and to do this, we must understand the ancient version of the polis.

It is time, then, to turn to the ancient world which was destroyed by the modern world we have been describing (MacIntyre offers a history of how the new world came to replace the old one in After Virtue, Chapter 16). Most of our attention will be focused, as MacIntyre's is, on the Athenian polis, or city-state, in the time of Aristotle, and on Aristotle's thought, which MacIntyre believes is an expression of the way of life of the Athenian upper class. As with his description of modernity, his descriptions of the ancient world and Aristotle's thought are contentious, and there are many points on which other scholars disagree with his arguments and his conclusions. We will be focusing on the contrast between the ancient world and the modern world and the reasons MacIntyre believes the former to be in many ways superior. Keep in mind that ultimately he wants us to learn from the institutions and ideas of the past and modify them to fit the conditions of the modern world; the final part of this essay will describe how his new world would differ from the world in which we now live.

MacIntyre does not want to try to recreate the polis, nor does he believe it would be possible even if it were desirable. MacIntyre also does not simply offer uncritical praise of the polis. He is strongly opposed to many of the institutions that made day-to-day polis life possible: slavery, the treatment of women, the elitism of its politics and political philosophy, and its exclusion of outsiders. One can summarize these positions by saying that MacIntyre rejects those elements of the polis and of Aristotle's thought that are hierarchical in a way that subordinates some people (actually most people) for the good of others. So MacIntyre realizes that there is much in the polis that we do not and should not wish to restore. He believes that it is possible to separate the positive features of the polis from its negative features, keeping the former while rejecting the latter; whether he is correct in this is an open question.

9. Heroic Society and Homer

For MacIntyre, understanding the polis means understanding its predecessor: heroic society as described by Homer in the Iliad and Odyssey (After Virtue Chapter 10; Whose Justice? Which Rationality? Chapter 2). In heroic society, MacIntyre says, people did not see themselves as we moderns do, as individuals bearing rights and seeking autonomy from external control through the manipulation of others. They also did not see themselves as constructing their own identities, choosing what they wanted to be and who they were. Instead, their identities came from their place within their society: "The self becomes what it is in heroic societies only through its role; it is a social creation, not an individual one" (After Virtue 129). Each individual had a fixed role resulting from their location in the social network, primarily through their particular ties to their family and kin, and each individual had the specific obligations and privileges attached to that location.

Many of these obligations were not chosen by the person bearing them, and that person was not free to choose other obligations instead. Nor would trying to evade one's obligations be praised as an example of adaptability; it would be condemned as a violation of the social order, which was the framework on which morality was built. People in this society did not try to determine morality in terms of abstract objective rules which applied to all equally – to try to place oneself outside of society was to cease to exist, because each person's identity made sense only in the context of that society. As MacIntyre puts it, each individual in such a society "has a given role and status within a well-defined and highly determinate system of roles and statuses….In such a society a man [sic] knows who he is by knowing his role in these structures; and in knowing this he knows also what he owes and what is owed to him by the occupant of every other role and status" (After Virtue 122). So in any particular situation, an individual would be able to understand what they should do in a straightforward way: the thing for them to do is the thing that it is appropriate for a person in their position to do by showing the proper regard for someone, meeting the particular obligations they have, doing what their duty requires them to do, and so forth. And it is also clear what actions must be performed in order to do these things. All they must do is ask what a person in their position is supposed to do in this situation and then do it.

In MacIntyre’s view, this kind of society, unlike modern societies, can have a genuine moral code, since failing to do what a person in a particular position is supposed to do is a moral failure, and that person can and will be judged accordingly by the other members of the society, who know what that person's duties, obligations, and privileges are and have legitimate claims on that person for them. This moral code is based on what is agreed to be the shared end of the society and the best way to achieve it, which gives each member their proper role in the society and their proper tasks. Heroic society is not by any means democratic, and so it would appear that democracy is not necessary to have this kind of society, but MacIntyre does believe that societies which include practices and virtues nowadays will prove to be democratic – much more democratic than they are now, in fact.

Recall our earlier discussion of the practices and the virtues. Taken as a whole, this kind of society can be understood as a kind of practice. Each individual agrees about what the virtues are – those traits that make it possible for them to carry out their obligations as they ought to in order to bring about the best possible life for the society as a whole – and they follow the virtues in living out their lives. There is also a determinate pattern to the life of each individual in the society, as each meets their obligations and fulfills their role like characters in a story. Remember the earlier suggestion that making sense out of morality today is like trying to tell a coherent story by mixing up parts of five or six very different novels. In this society, each individual is like a character in a story that is told by the society as a whole. The story is about what the good life is, and it provides a shared narrative for everyone. What is good for the individual and what is good for society are mutually reinforcing. If each individual does what they are supposed to do, the society will function as it should, and at the same time the society provides the context for the happy life spent in pursuit of the virtues that give meaning to the lives of its members.

10. The Athenian Polis and Aristotle

MacIntyre asserts that the virtues of heroic society and the heroic ideal carry forward into classical Athens, but since Athenian society is organized very differently than heroic society, this leads to difficulties. The virtues that are expressed in a society organized primarily around family and kinship networks have to be expressed differently in a society organized around the principle of the equality of citizens and the activity of politics. In MacIntyre's view, much of Athenian philosophy and art is engaged in redefining the heroic virtues to make them fit the new context of the polis; again we see how philosophy and society are interrelated, with changes in society leading to changes in philosophy. MacIntyre's definition of the polis is somewhat idiosyncratic: "The application of [the virtues as a way to measure an individual's goodness] in a community whose shared aim is the realization of the human good presupposes of course a wide range of agreement in that community on goods and virtues, and it is this agreement which makes possible the kind of bond between citizens which, on Aristotle's view, constitutes a polis” (After Virtue 155; see also Whose Justice? Which Rationality? 33-34). Restoring this agreement is the sense in which MacIntyre wants to return to the polis.

That the polis was the setting for the good life was, MacIntyre says, taken for granted by everyone participating in the debate about what the virtues could mean in their new setting, and in After Virtue he examines four of the voices in this debate: Plato, the sophists, playwrights such as Sophocles, and Aristotle. It is Aristotle who comes to be MacIntyre's focus, because it is Aristotle "whose account of the virtues decisively constitutes the classical tradition as a tradition of moral thought" (After Virtue 147). MacIntyre believes that Aristotle is essentially expressing the Athenian way of life in the form of a philosophy. Some scholars would disagree with this argument, but let us consider Aristotle more closely in order to see MacIntyre’s argument.

Aristotle's philosophy has at its heart the idea of a telos, or final purpose. Think about a knife for a moment. If you were asked to describe a knife, what would you say about it? You would probably describe its size and shape, what it is made out of, the fact that it has a handle and a blade, and you would probably also say that its purpose is to cut things. That purpose is its telos, and your description of the knife would be incomplete in an important way if you did not include it. It is fairly easy to see that something made by human beings has a telos, since humans generally create things for specific purposes. But Aristotle believes that things in the natural world also have a telos. The acorn has as its telos growing into a big, tall, strong oak tree, full of healthy acorns. The baby thoroughbred horse has as its telos being a swift runner; the wolf cub will grow up to hunt well; and so on. Human beings also have a telos, and according to Aristotle it is to be happy by living a life in accordance with the virtues. This is the inherent purpose of human life, and each of us is intended by nature to live a virtuous life in the same way the acorn is meant to be an oak tree and the colt is meant to be a swift racehorse. We do not get to choose what our telos is, any more than a knife or an acorn or a horse does. We do get to choose whether or not we are going to try to achieve it, and we can be held responsible if we do not (The MacIntyre Reader, "Plain Persons and Moral Philosophy").

The idea of a telos can be used to provide standards for normatively evaluating things. For example, if I have a knife that will not hold an edge, or has a handle that falls off, I have a knife that will not be able to fulfill its telos. It cannot do what it is supposed to do and what it was made to do. I can therefore say that it is a bad knife. Similarly, a wolf that is fat and lazy, or unable to scent animals, or runs slowly, is not the ideal wolf. It has not become what it was supposed to be. And human beings, if they do not pursue the life of happiness through virtuous behavior that is their telos, are bad human beings. They are guilty of moral failure, and everyone who agrees about what the human telos is will have to agree to that, in the same way they will have to agree that a knife that falls apart whenever someone tries to use it is a bad knife. Thus, for people who share a telos and whose community expresses that shared telos, morality has context and meaning.

It should be pointed out here that contemporary philosophies such as emotivism deny that there is a human telos (with ruinous consequences as far as MacIntyre is concerned). The idea that there is a human telos carries with it its own problems. Most obviously, it has at least so far proven impossible to unite all people behind a particular idea of what that telos is, or to demonstrate how we can be sure that a telos even exists. Often, the idea that nature or the gods want people to pursue certain goals and behave in certain ways has been used as a pretext for human tyranny. Many would point to the Taliban in Afghanistan, or the Catholic Inquisition, as an example of this. Also, there have been historical eras in which people in different societies strongly believed that there was a telos, but disagreed about what it was (in fact, the era of the polis in Greece was one such era). This has often led to war. The liberal idea of religious toleration, based on the idea that the proper work of government is the protection of people's bodies and property rather than their soul (see Locke's Letter Concerning Toleration), was in part the result of the religious wars, which were in part about the best life for human beings, that ravaged Europe for centuries (and ravage other parts of the world today). MacIntyre points out, however, that just because we haven't reached agreement on this subject doesn't mean that we can't, and he argues that the belief that we can't is a historically specific belief, rather than an objective and permanent truth about how the world works. If we reason correctly, and examine competing philosophical traditions of moral enquiry, we can choose the most accurate one. (This is the task of Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry).

You may want to think about physical health as an analogy. If I want to be healthy, I am much more likely to succeed if I am willing to exercise, eat sensibly, avoid tobacco and other drugs, and do what my doctor tells me, even when that means undergoing painful surgery, paying for expensive treatments, or swallowing foul-tasting medicines. I am certainly free not to do any of these things. I can smoke, overeat, lie on the couch all day, and never go near a doctor's office. But in that case I won't be healthy, and I don't get to redefine "health" to cover my condition. If I said I was living such a lifestyle because I was trying to live a healthy life, anyone who knew anything about health would laugh at me. Since health is preferable to sickness, I should be willing to reject unhealthy behaviors that are temporarily pleasant to achieve what is really good for me in the long run. Yet often I do not. In the same way, I should give up things that do not bring me closer to my telos by contributing to a virtuous life. But, again, often I do not. And if we accept that certain things are inherently good or harmful for our bodies because of our nature as particular kinds of animals, why shouldn't we accept the same principle regarding our souls?

As human beings, we are not always inclined to live a virtuous life devoted to the pursuit of the virtues, but that is the life that we should lead. MacIntyre calls this the distinction between "human nature as it is" and "human nature as it could be if it realized its telos" (After Virtue 52). The role of ethical theory is to take us from the former condition to the latter, teaching us how to overcome the weaknesses of our human nature and become what we are capable of becoming, as well as why this ought to be our good. It is like a road map, showing us where we are and where we need to get to and identifying the hazards along the way. Recall that MacIntyre said that in the modern world people believe that they do not have any fixed telos or purpose; there is nothing that we are meant to become, no innate goal that we move towards. (MacIntyre points to Hobbes and Leviathan as an example of this philosophical belief and its consequences). Absent any conception of what human beings are supposed to become if they realized their telos, there can be no ethical theory, because it simply has no purpose. For people with no destination, a road map has no value.

We have seen MacIntyre's description of modernity and its problems, and we have seen his description of the life of the polis and the philosophy of Aristotle. This brings us to the choice MacIntyre says confronts us. In After Virtue he says that we can either choose the modern world, with its emotivism, liberalism and capitalism – a world which, if we are honest, is actually a Nietzschean world – or we can choose to return to a morality and a conception of the virtues based on the philosophy of Aristotle (After Virtue Chapter 18). MacIntyre wants us to reject Nietzsche and choose Aristotle – not on the basis of the kind of arbitrary decision made under emotivism, but on the grounds that the kind of rational morality proposed by Aristotle does not fall prey to the criticisms of Nietzsche. It remains to describe what the future would hold if MacIntyre were successful in his project. How would a world based on the experience of the polis and the philosophy of Aristotle that world differ from the world we live in today? After Virtue ends without providing much guidance – MacIntyre says that we are waiting for a new Saint Benedict (who was the founder of monasticism in the Catholic tradition) to lead us out of the new dark ages (After Virtue 263) – but in his later writings he has offered more detail about what a better world would look like.

11. Our Human Nature: Dependent Rational Animals and Human Virtues

Much of what MacIntyre has to say on this topic is found in Dependent Rational Animals, and that book will be the focus of this section of the essay. MacIntyre intends the book to answer two questions: "Why is it important for us to attend to and to understand what human beings have in common with members of other intelligent animal species?" and "What makes attention to human vulnerability and disability important for moral philosophers?" (Dependent Rational Animals ix). The book reflects MacIntyre's change of position regarding whether "an ethics independent of biology" is possible (Dependent Rational Animals x). In After Virtue he had rejected Aristotle's biological teleology – which is the idea that human beings have a telos because of the particular kind of creature that we are. Aristotle says that only human beings have the ability to speak and reason and therefore our telos is to develop that reason. In Dependent Rational Animals MacIntyre now accepts the idea of a biological teleology, but much of his argument for this is based on the idea that it is not human beings alone that have the ability to speak and reason; dolphins and gorillas can also do these things, and we can learn something about humans from how these other animals pursue their individual and collective goods. What we learn is that for human beings the key to flourishing is to be an independent practical reasoner (Dependent Rational Animals 77). What are the consequences of this?

MacIntyre now believes that any successful ethical theory must comprehend three aspects of human existence: we are dependent, we are rational, and we are animals. The first and third of these, he says, are seldom taken into account by philosophers, and the second is frequently overemphasized. Aristotle comes in for particular criticism for denying the merit of the experiences of dependent human beings and making a virtue out of self-sufficient superiority (Dependent Rational Animals 6-7, 127). These are flaws which can be seen to contribute to MacIntyre's turning away from Aristotle and towards Aquinas, whose account of the human telos and virtues includes resources that allow us to include everyone in the community rather than a small elite as Aristotle's philosophy does. Much of the book is concerned with placing human beings in relationship to other animals, especially with regard to intelligence and rationality. MacIntyre argues that human beings retain their animal natures in important ways (Dependent Rational Animals 49) and that we are like gorillas and dolphins in that members of each species "pursue their respective goods in company with and in cooperation with each other" (Dependent Rational Animals 61).

Because we are animals, we are vulnerable to a wide range of inadequacies, deficiencies, and illnesses and are in need of the help of others if we are to survive and even more help if we are to thrive. Each of us has had the experience of dependency in infancy and childhood and most of us will face physical dependency again as we age. The kind of dependency that MacIntyre focuses on is our dependency on others to learn how to be rational and how to be ethical. This need is strongest in children, who at first simply follow whatever desires they happen to have at the moment. One of the things that parents must do (MacIntyre focuses on the mother throughout his discussion of parenting, without giving any reasons for this) is to teach their children that what they desire is not necessarily what is best for them at that time or what is best for them in the context of their life as a whole. Even when we pass beyond childhood, we still need others to watch and comment on our motives and actions, to insure that those aim at what is good for us and not merely at satisfying our temporary and potentially harmful desires. These are our friends, who provide us with insight and self-understanding, not least because they call us to account for our actions when those seem immoral, short sighted, or out of character. To provide such an account I must first reflect on my motivations and goals, and then explain them in such a way that my friend can make sense of them.

This is one of the ways in which I need other people, receive things from them, and am dependent on them. Throughout my life, other people assist me in developing the use of my reason, and I am dependent on others for this; I cannot become rational on my own. I can only grow if I can reason with and learn from others, and this requires certain traits from me: the virtues (honesty, courage, and justice, for example). Each of us also finds that others are dependent on us at different times and in different ways, and we are obligated to assist them in developing the same qualities and virtues others are helping us to develop; and this assistance is itself a virtue. We therefore find ourselves as part of a community of giving and receiving which is a network of duties and obligations. Potentially, of course, these same networks are dangerous; MacIntyre acknowledges that these structures of giving and receiving are also structures of unequal power distribution and potentially of domination and deprivation (Dependent Rational Animals 102). We must take care to see that they are not used in this way. But this network of obligations in the service of a shared good – the development of human capacities to reason and behave virtuously – means that this kind of society resembles the polis as MacIntyre understands it.

So acknowledging our nature as a particular kind of animal forces us to acknowledge our dependence on others to develop our rationality and become independent and our need to use our rationality to help dependent others (hence the title: Dependent Rational Animals). MacIntyre says that each of these is a different kind of virtue: the virtues of dependence differ from the virtues of independence but are nonetheless virtues (Dependent Rational Animals Chapter 10). This in turn requires us to acknowledge the networks of relationships of which we are a part, and once we have done this we can and must deliberate about the social and political institutions we wish to create in order to promote and protect these networks. Collectively promoting the social structures we need in order to flourish as individuals enables us to escape from false dichotomies between self-interest and the common interest and between selfishness and altruism. In supporting the networks that are necessary if we are to flourish, I am promoting both my interest and everyone else's, and I am looking out for the common good as well as my own individual good. Practices, then, are both consequences of our nature as the kind of animals we are, when we properly understand the kind of animals we are, and forms of social order that are in keeping with our nature, as opposed to contemporary forms of social order (liberalism and capitalism) which are not.

12. A New Politics

MacIntyre has shown that his ideal society would be different from our own in two particular areas, politics and economics, and now it is time to consider what he believes we should do in order to bring this ideal society into being. As was stated at the very beginning of this essay, MacIntyre is writing in order to resist the modern world, including modern politics. "Modern systematic politics, whether liberal, conservative, radical, or socialist, simply has to be rejected from a standpoint that owes genuine allegiance to the tradition of the virtues; for modern politics itself expresses in its institutional forms a systematic rejection of that tradition" (After Virtue 255). When we have made the changes MacIntyre wants to see, politics will no longer be civil war by other means: "the politics of such communities…is not a politics of competing interests in the way in which the politics of the modern state is" (Dependent Rational Animals 144). It is instead a shared project, and one that is shared by all adults, rather than being limited to a few elites who have gained power through manipulation and use that power to gain the goods of effectiveness for themselves. Politics will not be about people selfishly fighting over power and money; instead there will be "a conception of political activity as one aspect of the everyday activity of every adult capable of engaging in it" (Dependent Rational Animals 141). Human beings, as the kind of creatures we are, need the internal goods/goods of excellence that can only be acquired through participation in politics if we are to flourish. Therefore, everyone must be allowed to have access to the political decision-making process. The matters to be discussed and decided on will not be limited as they are now; they will extend to questions about what the good life is for the community and those who make it up. Politics will be especially concerned with the virtues of justice and generosity, ensuring that citizens get what they deserve and what they need. And it is an important requirement of this new politics that, everyone must "have a voice in communal deliberation about what these norms of justice require" (Dependent Rational Animals 129-130). This kind of deliberation requires small communities; although not every kind of small community is healthy, a healthy politics can only take place in a small community. Although their size cannot be precisely specified, they will be intermediate in scale between the family and the modern state (Dependent Rational Animals 131).

Politics will be understood and lived as a practice, and it will be about the pursuit of internal goods/goods of excellence rather than external goods/goods of effectiveness. "It is only because and when a certain range of moral commitments is shared, as it must be within a community structured by networks of giving and receiving, that not only shared deliberation, but shared critical enquiry concerning that deliberation and the way of life of which it is a part, becomes possible" (Dependent Rational Animals 161). When the community deliberates collectively about its best way of life it is choosing a telos, or final end. And that final end will be one which reflects the needs of all the citizens, including the need to have and use the virtues, which are part of our nature as dependent rational animals.

MacIntyre's communities will also have traditions and histories, and they will have people who are authorities to whom the rest of us will submit ourselves while we learn about those traditions and histories. Think back to the discussion of chess. Authority in chess is derived from a mastery of the virtues internal to the game (or goods of excellence) rather than external virtues (or goods of effectiveness). Chess players with authority do not have authority because they dominate others, or because they have wealth or political power. Players recognize who has mastered the virtues internal to the game, and try to learn from them. Rather than hating or resenting or fearing those with authority, they welcome and value them; the powerful seek to share their knowledge and skills for the good of the game, rather than for purposes of domination or exploitation. All the players recognize the rules of the game that make it possible for the game to educate us in its virtues, and they follow those rules because they recognize them as necessary and desirable. They are loyal to the game, they enjoy it, and they genuinely care about those with whom they share it. There is competition, to be sure, but it is in the service of pursuing a common good. The political community, for MacIntyre, must be this kind of community.

13. A New Economics

Capitalism must be replaced or transformed, or at least ways must be found to shield individual small communities from its effects. "The tradition of the virtues is at variance with central features of the modern economic order and more especially its individualism, its acquisitiveness and its elevation of the values of the market to a central social place" (After Virtue 254). The ideas that the purpose of life is to get rich and that the well-being of a society can be measured by its economic production will both be rejected, for these both reflect a focus on the goods of effectiveness rather than the goods of excellence. In addition, capitalism undermines communities of all kinds, including the family; we must have a way of life that puts the common good first. "Market relationships can only be sustained by being embedded in certain types of local nonmarket relationship, relationships of uncalculated giving and receiving, if they are to contribute to overall flourishing, rather than, as they so often in fact do, undermine and corrupt communal ties" (Dependent Rational Animals 117). There are many possibilities for how we might construct new economic systems. "The institutional forms through which such a way of life is realized, although economically various, have this in common: they do not promote economic growth and they require some significant degree of insulation from and protection from the forces generated by outside markets" (Dependent Rational Animals 145; The MacIntyre Reader 249). The society MacIntyre prefers will have only small inequalities of income and wealth, to prevent people from being excluded from the community by their poverty or placing themselves above it on account of their great wealth, both of which phenomena we certainly see today (and which Aristotle recognized in his day). If MacIntyre is correct that growing up as human beings is about learning to overcome our immediate desires and learning to see our long term good, then advertising and marketing, which teach us to give in to our immediate desires, are going to become much less effective. Markets must be subordinated to the development of the virtues in individuals and the community, rather than the other way around, which is what happens in the world in which we now live.

14. Conclusion

MacIntyre’s ideal world would be very different from today’s world, and it is one that would undoubtedly take decades, and probably centuries, to arrive, just as the replacement of Aristotelian morality by liberal capitalism took a very long time. What are we to do in the meantime if we wish to carry out MacIntyre's vision? MacIntyre says that we can begin to work on the kinds of small communities that are capable of preserving the practices and virtues even in the face of liberal capitalism (Whose Justice? Which Rationality? 99). We need to focus our energies on building and maintaining the kinds of small communities where practices and the virtues have a place and protecting them as much as possible from the depredations of the modern state and modern capitalism. At the end of Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry, he proposes ways to modify universities and their curricula to bring them closer to the kind of communities he wants to encourage. As far back as 1968's Marxism and Christianity, MacIntyre was advocating "a politics of self-defence for all those local societies that aspire to achieve some relatively self-sufficient and independent form of participatory practice-based community" (Marxism and Christianity xxvi, cited in The MacIntyre Reader 23; see The MacIntyre Reader 248 and Breen 187). Small communities will also make it possible for people to evaluate political candidates in a variety of settings and judge them on the basis of integrity rather than adaptability (The MacIntyre Reader 249). We can evaluate our leaders on their actual characters rather than seeing them through the distortions of advertising and the manipulation of propaganda.

MacIntyre's objections to liberal capitalism show the influences of both the Marxism to which he subscribed early in his career and the Catholic Church of which he is now a member. Both Marxism and Catholicism, for different reasons, critique the unbridled pursuit of wealth under capitalism. But there are many reasons to doubt that the kind of society MacIntyre promotes will turn out as he wishes. Many authors, from Adam Smith to Hayek to von Mises, have argued that attempts to control or limit markets inevitably have as a consequence attempts to control and limit human beings in ways that lead to the gulag rather than to the virtues. They would also argue that MacIntyre's proposals, by limiting or discouraging economic growth, would condemn the poor to continued poverty and prevent improvements in living standards in general, and would punish people who are able to successfully provide people with what they want while profiting from this success. This would kill initiative and innovation and lead to stagnation. Whether people agree or disagree, MacIntyre would probably take some satisfaction in the fact that at least there is an argument going on – a serious discussion about the ultimate values and way of life the community should pursue – which is typically avoided or stifled on those rare occasions when it does arise. The next step would be to make this kind of argument a part of mainstream political discussions.

If his ideas become widespread and are widely adopted, MacIntyre's small communities, like St. Benedict's monasteries, will preserve the practices, the virtues, and morality until such a time as they can re-emerge into the world. In the meantime they will be the best way of life for those who are fortunate and hard-working enough to be a part of them. And of course those who, like MacIntyre, practice philosophy in his tradition must continue to strengthen and develop the arguments found in the Aristotelian tradition as it has developed through Aquinas, and continue to draw attention to the flaws and weaknesses of liberal philosophy in the hope of persuading others to change their allegiances.

15. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

This bibliography includes only the most significant books from the period beginning with After Virtue and is in chronological order.

  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. After Virtue. Second Edition. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1984 (1981).
    • The foundation of his later work and the most important of his books to read. Includes his arguments about the failures of modern philosophy and politics and how those failures might be overcome, or at least diminished, with the help of the philosophy of Aristotle and the political way of life of the Greek city-state.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Whose Justice? Which Rationality? Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1988.
    • MacIntyre addresses "both what makes it rational to act in one way rather than another and what makes it rational to advance and defend one conception of practical rationality rather than another" (p. ix).
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1990.
    • MacIntyre discusses three rival versions of moral enquiry: encyclopedia, tradition, and geneaology. He describes how they conflict with one another and the possibility that one of these traditions can "emerge as indisputably rationally superior" (p. 5). It is the Thomist tradition, he argues, that proves to be rationally superior to the others.
  • Knight, Kelvin. The MacIntyre Reader. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1998.
    • This is a collection of articles by MacIntyre, extracts from After Virtue and Whose Justice? Which Rationality?, and a pair of interviews of MacIntyre, along with an introductory essay on MacIntyre by Knight. The book is an excellent source for anyone looking for an overview of MacIntyre's career, and Knight's essay is an outstanding analysis of MacIntyre's project. There is also a very thorough Guide to Further Reading, in essay form, in which Knight again reveals a sympathetic and extensive knowledge of MacIntyre's work. Highly recommended.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Dependent Rational Animals: Why Human Beings Need the Virtues. Chicago: Open Court, 1999.
    • MacIntyre begins this book with the claim that any moral philosophy must begin by acknowledging that human beings are a particular kind of animal with particular needs and goods that are determined by our animal nature. He then establishes what that nature is, and argues that it requires us to develop our rationality while acknowledging our dependence on others, thus providing us with a telos. He provides a sketch of what kind of social organization would be necessary to enable each of us to fulfill our telos, and how that kind of organization differs from the organization of the modern world.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Ballard, Bruce W. Understanding MacIntyre. Lanham: University Press of America, Inc., 2000.
    • This short (90 page) book has two parts: the first part explains the fundamentals of MacIntyre's thought for beginning students, and the second part brings MacIntyre into contact with thinkers such as Marx, Kierkegaard, and Graybosch. Unfortunately these chapters are too brief to be really useful on their own; Chapter 10, for example, entitled "MacIntyre and His Critics," is a mere five pages long.
  • Breen, Keith. "Alasdair MacIntyre and the Hope for a Politics of Virtuous Acknowledged Dependence." Contemporary Political Theory (2002) 1, 181-201.
    • A political analysis of Dependent Rational Animals. The author concludes that MacIntyre must moderate his claims if he is to avoid self-contradiction and "a despairing purism."
  • Fuller, Michael. Making Sense of MacIntyre. Aldershot, UK: Ashgate, 1998.
    • This 144 page book has a title that might lead one to expect an introductory volume, but while there is a summary of MacIntyre's themes, the author also uses other philosophers, such as Donald Davidson and especially Richard Rorty, to make sense of MacIntyre's thought, and the reader who is not already familiar with Davidson and Rorty may find this material difficult to understand.
  • Horton, John, and Susan Mendus, eds. After MacIntyre: Critical Perspectives on the Work of Alasdair MacIntyre. Notre Dame: Notre Dame University Press, 1994.
    • This collection of essays is wide-ranging, including essays on MacIntyre's conception of justice, his characterization of liberalism, his interpretation of Aquinas and his critique of the Enlightenment. The last chapter is written by MacIntyre himself; entitled "A Partial Response To My Critics," it offers MacIntyre's responses to some of the criticisms offered by the other authors. (MacIntyre’s willingness to engage with his critics is both rare and admirable).
  • McMylor, Peter. Alasdair MacIntyre: Critic of Modernity. London: Routledge, 1994.
    • The author is a sociologist who treats MacIntyre's work as social criticism. Part one is entitled "MacIntyre – Christianity and/or Marxism?" and part two is "Markets, Managers, and the Virtues."
  • Murphy, Mark C., ed. Alasdair MacIntyre. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
    • A collection of eight essays by various scholars, with an introduction by Murphy, that address different aspects of MacIntyre's thought. Chapters 6 and 7, "MacIntyre's Political Philosophy," by Murphy, and "MacIntyre's Critique of Modernity," by Terry Pinkard, were especially helpful in working on this essay. The book concludes with an excellent bibliography of works by and about MacIntyre.
  • Weinstein, Jack Russell. On MacIntyre. No location: Thomson Wadsworth, 2003.
    • Intended for the beginning philosophy student and the general reader. Chapter 2 is a brief biography of MacIntyre's life with an emphasis on his intellectual influences; Chapter 3 focuses on MacIntyre's theological work, particularly MacIntyre's early comparisons of Christianity and Marxism.

Author Information

Ted Clayton
Central Michigan University
U. S. A.

John Rawls (1921—2002)

John RawlsJohn Rawls was arguably the most important political philosopher of the twentieth century. He wrote a series of highly influential articles in the 1950s and ’60s that helped refocus Anglo-American moral and political philosophy on substantive problems about what we ought to do. His first book, A Theory of Justice [TJ] (1971), revitalized the social-contract tradition, using it to articulate and defend a detailed vision of egalitarian liberalism. In Political Liberalism [PL] (1993), he recast the role of political philosophy, accommodating it to the effectively permanent “reasonable pluralism” of religious, philosophical, and other comprehensive doctrines or worldviews that characterize modern societies. He explains how philosophers can characterize public justification and the legitimate, democratic use of collective coercive power while accepting that pluralism.

Although most of this article will be devoted to TJ, the exposition of that work will take account of Political Liberalism and other later works of Rawls. TJ sets out and defends the principles of Justice as Fairness. Rawls takes the basic structure of society as his subject matter and utilitarianism as his principal opponent. Part One of TJ designs a social-contract-type thought experiment, the Original Position (OP), and argues that parties in the OP will prefer Justice as Fairness to utilitarianism and various other views. In order to understand the argument from the OP, one must pay special attention to the motivation of the parties to the OP, which is philosophically stipulated and provided with a Kantian interpretation. Part Two of TJ checks the fit between the principles of Justice as Fairness and our more concrete considered views about just institutions, thereby helping move us towards a reflective equilibrium that supports those principles. Part Three of TJ addresses the stability of a society organized around Justice as Fairness, arguing that there will be an important congruence in such a society between people’s views about justice and what they value. By the time he wrote Political Liberalism, however, Rawls had decided that an inconsistency in TJ called for recasting the argument for stability. In other ways, the argument of TJ rested on important simplifications, which had the effect of setting aside questions about international justice, disability, and familial justice. Rawls turned to these “problems of extension,” as he called them, at the end of his career.

Table of Contents

  1. Biographical Sketch
  2. Rawls's Mature Work: A Theory of Justice (1971)
    1. The Basic Structure of Society
    2. Utilitarianism as the Principal Opponent
    3. The Original Position
      1. The Conditions and Purpose of the Original Position
      2. The Motivations of the Parties to the Original Position
      3. Kantian Influence and Interpretation of the Original Position
    4. The Principles of Justice as Fairness
    5. The Argument from the Original Position
    6. Reflective Equilibrium
    7. Just Institutions
    8. Stability
    9. Congruence
  3. Recasting the Argument for Stability: Political Liberalism (1993)
  4. Problems of Extension
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Biographical Sketch

John Bordley Rawls was born and schooled in Baltimore, Maryland, USA. Although his family was of comfortable means, his youth was twice marked by tragedy. In two successive years, his two younger brothers contracted an infectious disease from him—diphtheria in one case and pneumonia in the other—and died. Rawls’s vivid sense of the arbitrariness of fortune may have stemmed in part from this early experience. His remaining, older brother attended Princeton for undergraduate studies and was a great athlete. Rawls followed his brother to Princeton. Although Rawls played baseball, he was, in later life at least, excessively modest about his success at that or at any other endeavor.

Rawls continued for his Ph.D. studies at Princeton and came under the influence of the first of a series of Wittgensteinean friends and mentors, Norman Malcolm. From them, he learned to avoid entanglement in metaphysical controversies when possible. Rawls’s doctoral dissertation (1950) already showed, however, that he would not be content to deconstruct our impulse to ask metaphysical questions; instead, he devoted himself to constructive philosophical tasks. Turning away from the then-influential program of attempting to analyze the meaning of the moral concepts, he replaced it with what was—for a philosopher—a more practically oriented task: that of characterizing a general method of moral decision making. Part of this dissertation work was the basis of his first published article, “Outline of a Decision Procedure for Ethics.” (1951). This was an early attempt to tackle the central question of Rawls’s mature theory: what sort of decision procedure can we imagine that would help us resolve disputed claims in a fair way?

Of equal significance to Rawls’s turn away from conceptual analysis and towards a more practical conception of moral philosophy was his encounter, during a year (1952-3) as a Fulbright Fellow in Oxford, with exciting, substantive work in legal and political philosophy, especially that of H.L.A. Hart and Isaiah Berlin. Hart had made progress in legal philosophy by connecting the idea of social practices with the institutions of the law. Rawls’s second published essay, “Two Concepts of Rules” (1955), uses a conception of social practices influenced by Hart to explore a kind of rule-utilitarianism. Compare TJ at 48n.. In Isaiah Berlin, Rawls met a brilliant historian of political thought—someone who, by his own account, had been driven away from philosophy by the aridity of mid-century conceptual analysis. Berlin influentially traced the historical careers of competing, large-scale values, such as liberty (which he distinguished as either negative or positive) and equality. Not long after his time in Oxford, Rawls embarked on what was to become a life-long project of finding a coherent and attractive way of combining freedom and equality into one conception of political justice. Cf. PL at 327. This project first took the form of a series of widely-discussed articles about justice published between 1958 and 1969.

After teaching at Cornell and MIT, Rawls took up a position in the philosophy department at Harvard in 1962. There he remained, being named a University Professor in 1979. Throughout his career, he devoted considerable attention to his teaching. In his lectures on moral and political philosophy, Rawls focused meticulously on great philosophers of the past—Locke, Hume, Rousseau, Leibniz, Kant, Hegel, Marx, Mill, and others—always approaching them deferentially and with an eye to what we could learn from them. Mentor to countless graduate students over the years, Rawls inspired many who have become influential interpreters of these philosophers.

The initial publication of A Theory of Justice in 1971 brought Rawls considerable renown. This complex book, which reveals Rawls’s thorough study of economics as well as his internalization of themes from the philosophers covered in his teaching, has since been translated into 27 languages. While there are those who would claim a greater originality for Political Liberalism, TJ remains the cornerstone of Rawls’s reputation.

2. Rawls's Mature Work: A Theory of Justice (1971)

a. The Basic Structure of Society

The subject matter of Rawls’s theory is societal practices and institutions. Some social institutions can provoke envy and resentment. Others can foster alienation and exploitation. Is there a way of organizing society that can keep these problems within livable limits? Can society be organized around fair principles of cooperation in a way the people would stably accept?

Rawls’s original thought is that equality, or a fair distribution of advantages, is to be addressed as a background matter by constitutional and legal provisions that structure social institutions. While fair institutions will influence the life chances of everyone in society, they will leave individuals free to exercise their basic liberties as they see fit within this fair set of rules. To carry out this central idea, Rawls takes as the subject matter of TJ “the basic structure of society,” defined (as he later put it) as “the way in which the major social institutions fit together into one system, and how they assign fundamental rights and duties and shape the division of advantages that arises through social cooperation.” PL at 258. Rawls’s suggestion is, in effect, that we should put all our effort into seeing to it that “the rules of the game” are fair. Once society has been organized around a set of fair rules, people can set about freely “playing” the game, without interference.

b. Utilitarianism as the Principal Opponent

Rawls explains in the Preface to the first edition of TJ that one of the book’s main aims is to provide a “workable and systematic moral conception to oppose” utilitarianism. TJ at xvii. Utilitarianism comes in various forms. Classical utilitarianism, the nineteenth century theory of Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill, is the philosophy of “the greatest good of the greatest number.” The more modern version is average utilitarianism, which asks us not to maximize the amount of good or happiness, but rather its average level in society. The utilitarian idea, as Rawls confronts it, is that society is to be arranged so as to maximize (the total or average) aggregate utility or expected well-being. Utilitarianism historically dominated the landscape of moral philosophy, often being “refuted,” but always rising again from the ashes. Rawls’s view was that until a sufficiently complete and systematic alternative is put on the table to compete with utilitarianism, its recurrence will be eternal. In addition to developing that constructive alternative, however, Rawls also offered some highly influential criticisms of utilitarianism. His critique of average utilitarianism will be described below. About classical utilitarianism, he famously complains that it “adopt[s] for society as a whole the principle of choice for one man.” In so doing, he suggests, it fails to “take seriously the distinction between persons.” TJ at 24.

c. The Original Position

Recognizing that social institutions distort our views (by sometimes generating envy, resentment, alienation, or false consciousness) and bias matters in their own favor (by indoctrinating and habituating those who grow up under them), Rawls saw the need for a justificatory device that would give us critical distance from them. The original position (OP) is his “Archimedean Point,” the fulcrum he uses to obtain critical leverage. TJ at 230-32. The OP is a thought experiment that asks: what principles of social justice would be chosen by parties thoroughly knowledgeable about human affairs in general but wholly deprived—by the “veil of ignorance”—of information about the particular person or persons they represent?

i. The Conditions and Purpose of the Original Position

The OP, as Rawls designs it, self-consciously builds on the long social-contract tradition in Western political philosophy. In classic presentations, such as John Locke’s Second Treatise of Civil Government (1690), the social contract was sometimes described as if it were an actual historical event. By contrast, Rawls’s social-contract device, like his earlier decision procedure, is frankly and completely hypothetical. While Rawls is most emphatic about this in his later work, for example, PL at 75, it is clear already in TJ. He insists there that it is up to the theorist to construct the social-contract thought-experiment in the way that makes the most sense given its task of helping us select principles of justice. Especially because of its frankly hypothetical nature, Rawls’s OP “carries to a higher level of abstraction the familiar theory of the social contract as found, say in Locke, Rousseau, and Kant.” TJ at 10.

The idea is to help justify a set of principles of social justice by showing that they would be selected in the OP. The OP is accordingly set up to build in the moral conditions deemed necessary for the resulting choice to be fair and to insulate the results from the influence of the extant social order. The veil of ignorance plays a crucial role in this set-up. TJ at sec. 23. It assures that each party to the choice is equally or symmetrically situated, with none enjoying greater power (or “threat advantage”) than any other. TJ at 116, 121. It also isolates the parties’ choice from the contingencies—the sheer luck—underlying the variations in people’s natural abilities and talents, their social backgrounds, and their particular society’s historical circumstances. About their society, Rawls has the parties simply assume that it is characterized by the “circumstances of justice,” which principally include (a) the fact that material goods are scarce, but moderately so and (b) that there is, within society, a plurality of worldviews—“conceptions of the good” —moral, religious, and secular. TJ at sec. 22.

It would be too fanciful to think of the parties to the OP as having the capacity to invent principles. The point of the thought experiment, rather, is to see which principles would be chosen in a fair set-up. To use the OP this way, we must offer the parties a menu of principles to choose from. Rawls offers them various principles to consider. Among them are his own principles (to be described below) and the two versions of utilitarianism, classical and average. The crux of Rawls’s appeal to the OP is whether he can show that the parties will prefer his principles to average utilitarianism.

Would rational parties behind a veil of ignorance choose average utilitarianism? The economist John Harsanyi argues that they would because it would be rational for parties lacking any other information to maximize their expectation of well-being. Harsanyi (1953) Since they do not know who they will be, they will therefore want to maximize the average level of well-being in society. Given Rawls’s opposition to utilitarianism, it would be ironic if Rawls’s thought experiment supported it. Because Rawls’s OP differs from Harsanyi’s choice situation in important ways, however, its parties will not prefer average utilitarianism to Rawls’s competing principles. The most crucial difference concerns the motivation that is attributed to the parties by stipulation. The veil deprives the parties of any knowledge of the values—the conception of the good—of the person into whose shoes they are to imagine stepping. What, then, are they to prefer? Since Harsanyi refuses to supply his parties with any definite motivation, his answer is somewhat mysterious. Cf. TJ at 152. Rawls instead defines the parties as having a determinate set of motivations.

ii. The Motivations of the Parties to the Original Position

The parties in the hypothetical OP are to choose on behalf of persons in society, for whom they are, in effect, trustees. PL at 76, 106. The veil of ignorance, however, prevents the parties from knowing anything particular about the preferences, likes or dislikes, commitments or aversions of those persons. They also know nothing particular about the society for which they are choosing. On what basis, then, can the parties choose? To ascribe to them a full theory of the human good would fly in the face of the facts of pluralism, for such theories are deeply controversial. Instead, Rawls suggests, we should ascribe to them a “thinner” or less controversial set of commitments. At the core of these are what he calls the “primary goods:” rights, liberties, and opportunities; income and wealth; and the social bases of self-respect. To give the parties a definite basis on which to reason, Rawls postulates that the parties “normally prefer more primary goods rather than less.” TJ at 123. This is the only motivation that TJ ascribes to the parties.

In their pursuit of the primary goods, the parties are defined as being “mutually disinterested:” each is motivated to obtain as many primary goods as he or she can and does not care if others attain primary goods. TJ at 12. The parties are motivated neither by benevolence nor by envy or spite. Many commentators think that this assumption of the parties’ mutual disinterest reflects an unattractively individualistic view of human nature, but, as with the motivations ascribed to the parties, the ascription of mutual disinterest is not intended to mirror human nature. The assumption of mutual disinterest reflects Rawls’s development of, and reaction against, both the sympathetic-spectator tradition in ethics, exemplified by David Hume and Adam Smith, and the more recent ideal-observer theory. The former tradition attempts to imagine the point of view of a fully benevolent spectator of the human scene who reacts impartially and sympathetically to all human travails and successes. The ideal-observer theory typically imagines a somewhat more dispassionate or impersonal, but still omniscient, observer of the human scene. Each of these approaches asks us to imagine what such a spectator or observer would morally approve.

Against these theories, Rawls raises a number of objections, which can be boiled down to this: either they involve neglecting the separateness of persons (in roughly the same way that utilitarianism does when it adds up everyone’s happiness), TJ at 164, or, if they seek to avoid utilitarian aggregation, they will find that “benevolence is at sea as long as its many loves are in opposition in the persons of its many objects.” TJ at 166. In other words, all difficult questions of human conflict will be simply reproduced within the sympathetic spectator’s breast. Rawls was determined to get beyond this impasse. He suggests that the OP should combine the mutual-disinterest assumption with the veil of ignorance. This combination, he argues, will achieve the rough moral equivalence of universal benevolence without either neglecting the separateness of persons or sacrificing definiteness of results. TJ at 128.

As we will see, the definite positive motivations that Rawls ascribes to the parties are crucial to explaining why they will prefer his principles to average utilitarianism. Because the parties’ motivations are essential to the arguments bearing on this central philosophical contest, it is important to attend to Rawls’s rationale for giving this motivation to the parties.

The primary goods are supposed to be uncontroversially worth seeking, albeit not for their own sakes. Initially, TJ presented the primary goods simply as goods that “normally have a use whatever a person’s plan of life.” TJ at 54. Although this claim seems quite modest, philosophers rebutted it by describing life plans or worldviews for which one or another of the primary goods is not useful. These counterexamples revealed the need for a different rationale for the primary goods. At roughly the same time, Rawls began to develop further the Kantian strand in his view. These Kantian ideas ended up providing a new rationale for the primary goods.

iii. Kantian Influence and Interpretation of the Original Position

Rawls had long admired Immanuel Kant’s moral philosophy, making it central to his teaching of the subject. See CP essays 13, 16, 23. TJ aims to build on Kant’s central ideas and to improve on them in certain respects. TJ at sec. 41. By insisting, as against utilitarianism, on the “separateness of persons,” Rawls carries on Kant’s theme of respect for persons. Kant held that the true principles of morality are not imposed on us by our psyches or by eternal conceptual relations that hold true independently of us; rather, Kant argued, the moral law is a law that our reason gives to itself. It is, in this sense, self-chosen or autonomous law. Kant’s position is not that morality requires whatever Ms. Smith or Mr. Jones chooses to believe it does. Rather, his claim is that the rational (or vernünftig) nature that each person shares shapes a single moral law, valid for all: “the categorical imperative.”

Rawls suggests that the OP well models Kant’s central ideas. The OP is set up so that the parties reflect our nature as “reasonable and rational”—Rawls’s dual way of rendering the Kantian adjective vernünftig. Once it is so set up the parties are to choose principles. Their task of choosing principles thus models the idea of autonomy. In designing the OP, Rawls also aimed to resolve what he took to be two crucial difficulties with Kant’s moral theory: the danger of empty abstractness early stressed by Hegel and the difficulty of assuring that the moral law’s dictates adequately express, as Kant thought they must, our nature as free and equal reasonable and rational beings. Rawls addresses the issue of abstractness in many ways—perhaps most fundamentally by dropping Kant’s aim of finding an a priori basis for morality. Although Rawls’s use of the veil of ignorance keeps particular facts at a distance, he insists, as against Kant, that “moral theory must be free to use contingent assumptions and general facts as it pleases.” TJ at 44. Another feature that reduces the abstractness of Rawls’s view is his focus on institutions—on the basic structure of society. In this light, we can see his institutional focus as carrying forward Hegel’s insight that the idea of human freedom can achieve an adequately concrete realization only by a unified social structure of a certain kind.

The OP also addresses the second problem with Kant’s moral theory—the problem of expression. The OP, Rawls suggests, “may be viewed … as a procedural interpretation of Kant’s conception of autonomy and the categorical imperative within the framework of an empirical theory.” TJ at 226. To be autonomous, for Kant, is to act on a law that one gives oneself, a law adequate to one’s nature as a free and equal, reasonable and rational person. The parties to the OP, in selecting principles, implement this idea of autonomy. How they represent equality and rationality are obvious, for they are equally situated and are rational by definition. Reasonableness enters the OP not principally by the rationality of the parties but by the constraints on them—most especially the veil of ignorance. They are also constrained in ways not yet mentioned and that we shall not discuss further, such as “the formal constraints of the concept of right.” TJ at sec. 23. The veil also expresses (or “models”) a crucial aspect of our freedom, namely our freedom to endorse principles in a way that is not controlled by the historical contingencies of the society into which we are born. TJ at 225.

Rawls’s attempt to solve the problem of expression also led him towards a fuller articulation of the parties’ motivations, ascribing to them certain “highest-order interests.” An intermediate step in this direction is his characterization of our three highest-order powers, the “moral powers” that persons have as reasonable and rational beings. “The rational” corresponds to Kant’s “hypothetical imperative” with its directive to take effective means to one’s ends; “the reasonable” corresponds to Kant’s categorical imperative, the moral law that demands that we do the right thing, irrespective of what our ends are. To conceive of persons as reasonable and rational, then, is to conceive of them as having certain higher-order powers. On the side of the rational, there is, first, the power to frame our ends—our “conception of the good”—and to pursue it by selecting effective means to satisfying them. Second, we can also revise our ends when we see reason to do so. Third, on the side of the reasonable, we have the power or capacity to act from “an effective sense of justice:” we can do the right thing.

This Kantian conception of the powers of reasonable and rational persons directly supports Rawls’s later account of the motivations of the parties. The parties are conceived as having highest-order interests that correspond directly to these highest-order powers. Although the account of the moral powers was present in TJ, it is only in his later works that Rawls uses this idea to defend and elaborate the motivation of the parties in the OP.

Rawls’s account of the moral powers explains why it makes sense to postulate that the parties are motivated to secure the primary goods. In various, complicated ways, in his later work, Rawls defends the primary goods as being required for free and equal citizens to promote and protect their three moral powers. This is to cast the primary goods as items objectively needed by moral persons occupying the role of free and equal citizens. While the list of primary goods may not be a perfect or complete account of what is needed to support this aspect of moral personality, Rawls claims that it is the “best available” account that we can muster in the face of the fact of reasonable pluralism. PL at 188-9.

In addition to providing a new rationale for the primary goods, Rawls’s account of the moral powers also became, in his later work, a basis for elaborating the motivations ascribed to the parties. In Political Liberalism, Rawls describes the motivation as: “The parties in the original position have no direct interests except an interest in the person each of them represents and they assess principles of justice in terms of primary goods. In addition, they are concerned with securing for the person they represent the higher-order interests we have in developing and exercising our … moral powers and in securing the conditions under which we can further our determinate conceptions of the good, whatever it is.” PL at 105-6. Here, the motivation of the parties is importantly extended by postulating that these hypothetical beings care about the moral powers of persons in society and also, by extension, about those persons’ ability to pursue what they particularly care about or are committed to.

Rawls’s assumptions about the motivations of the parties involve frankly moral content and are justified on openly moral grounds, as he had always avowed. His aim remains, nonetheless, to assemble in the OP a series of relatively uncontroversial, relatively fixed points among our considered moral judgments and to build an argument on that basis for the superiority of some principles of justice over others.

d. The Principles of Justice as Fairness

“Justice as Fairness” is Rawls’s name for the set of principles he defends in TJ. He refers to “the two principles of Justice as Fairness,” but the second has two parts. These principles address two different aspects of the basic structure of society: the “First Principle” addresses the essentials of the constitutional structure. It holds that society must assure each citizen “an equal claim to a fully adequate scheme of equal basic rights and liberties, which scheme is compatible with the same scheme for all.” PL at 5. The second principle addresses instead those aspects of the basic structure that shape the distribution of opportunities, offices, income, wealth, and in general social advantages. The first part of the second principle holds that the social structures that shape this distribution must satisfy the requirements of “fair equality of opportunity.” The second part of the second principle is the famous—or infamous—“Difference Principle.” It holds that ”social and economic inequalities … are to be to the greatest benefit of the least advantaged members of society.” PL at 6. Each of these three centrally addresses a different set of primary goods: the First Principle concerns rights and liberties; the principle of Fair Equality of Opportunity concerns opportunities; and the Difference Principle primarily concerns income and wealth. (That the view adequately secures the social basis of self-respect is something that Rawls argues more holistically). TJ at 477-8.

e. The Argument from the Original Position

The argument that the parties in the OP will prefer Justice as Fairness to utilitarianism and to the various other alternative principles with which they are presented divides into two parts. There is, first, the question whether the parties will insist upon securing a scheme of equal basic liberties and upon giving them top priority. Secondly, assuming that they will, there remains the question whether social inequalities should be governed by Rawls’s “second principle,” comprising Fair Equality of Opportunity and the Difference Principle, or else should be addressed in a utilitarian way. Making the latter choice, and so inserting utilitarianism into a position subordinate to the First Principle, yields what Rawls calls a “mixed conception.” TJ at 107.

Each of these parts of the argument from the OP is considerably aided by the clarified account of the primary goods that emerges in Rawls’s later work and that has been set out above in the section on the motivation of the parties to the OP. Regarding the first part of the argument from the OP, the crucial point is that the parties are stipulated to care about rights and liberties. They further know, as a general fact about human beings, that the determinate persons on whose behalf they are choosing are likely to have firmly and deeply-held “religious, philosophical, and moral views.” PL at 311 They also have a higher-order interest in protecting these persons’ abilities to advance these conceptions. Accordingly, “they cannot take chances by permitting a lesser liberty of conscience to minority religions, say, on the possibility that those they represent espouse a majority or dominant religion.” PL at 311. Rawls admits that persons’ deeply-held views are not always set in stone, but he insists that not all circumstances in which they may change are morally acceptable. He argues that protecting one’s ability to exercise one’s highest-order power to change one’s mind about such things requires an adequate scheme of basic liberties. PL at 312-3. In addition, he argues that securing the First Principle importantly serves the higher-order interest in an effective sense of justice—and does so better than the pure utilitarian alternative—by better promoting social stability, mutual respect, and social unity. PL at 317-24.

The second part of the argument from the OP takes the First Principle for granted and addresses the matter of social inequalities. Its sticking point has always been the Difference Principle, which strikingly and influentially articulates a liberal-egalitarian socioeconomic position. While there are questions about Rawls’s precise formulation and implementation of the principle of Fair Equality of Opportunity, it is far less controversial, both in theory and in practice. It is the Difference Principle that would most clearly demand deep reforms in existing societies. The set-up of the OP suggests the following, informal argument for the difference principle: because equality is an ideal fundamentally relevant to the idea of fair cooperation, the OP situates the parties symmetrically and deprives them of information that could distinguish them or allow one to gain bargaining advantage over another. Given this set-up, the parties will consider the situation of equal distribution a reasonable starting point in their deliberations. Since they know all the general facts about human societies, however, the parties will realize that society might depart from this starting point by instituting a system of social rules that differentially reward the especially productive and could achieve results that are better for everyone than are the results under rules guaranteeing full equality. This is the kind of inequality that the Difference Principle allows and requires: departures from full equality that make some better off and no one worse off.

While this is the intuitive idea behind the Difference Principle, Rawls’s statement of the principle is more careful and precise. Three main refinements are worth noting. First, because the principle pertains to the basic structure of society and because the parties are comparing different societies organized around different principles, the expectations that matter are not those of particular people but those of representative members of broad social classes. Second, to make his exposition a little simpler, Rawls makes some technical assumptions that let him focus only on the expectations of the least-well-off representative class in a given society. (These assumptions—of “close-knitness” and “chain-connection”—enable him to ignore, for instance, the possibility of increasing the inequality between the rich and the middle-class without affecting those on the bottom. For those who find these simplifying assumptions too restrictive, Rawls offers a multi-tiered, or “lexical,” version of the Difference Principle. TJ at 72. Allowed by these simplifying assumptions to focus only on the least well off representative persons, the Difference Principle thus holds that social rules allowing for inequalities in income and wealth are acceptable just in case those who are least well off under those rules are better off than the least-well-off representative persons under any alternative sets of social rules. This formulation already takes account of the third refinement, which recognizes that the people who are the worst off under one set of social arrangements may not be the same people as those who are worst off under some other set of social arrangements. Cf. PL at 7n.

The Difference Principle requires society to look out for the least well off. But would the parties to the OP prefer the Difference Principle to a utilitarian principle of distribution? Here, Rawls’s interpretation of the OP matters. It took a while for commentators to grasp the degree to which Rawls’s characterization of the OP departed from the much simpler one favored by Harsanyi, from the point of view of which Rawls’s argument for the Difference Principle appeared to be a plain mistake. For parties like Harsanyi’s, it would be irrational to choose the Difference Principle. Harsanyi’s parties lack any determinate motivation: as Rawls puts it, they are “bare-persons.” TJ at 152. With nothing but the bare idea of rationality to guide them, they will naturally choose any principle that will maximize their utility expectation. Since this is what the principle of Average Utilitarianism does, they will choose it. Yet as we have seen, Rawls departs from Harsanyi’s version of the thought experiment by attributing a determinate motivation to the parties, while denying that an index of the primary goods provides an interpretation of what the parties conceive to be good. Rawls never defends the primary goods as goods in themselves. Rather, he defends them as versatile means. In the later theory, the primary goods are defended as facilitating the pursuit and revision, by the persons the parties represent, of their conceptions of the good. While the parties do not know what those conceptions of the good are, they do care about whether the persons they represent can pursue and revise them.

With this departure from Harsanyi in mind, we may finally explain why the parties in the OP will prefer the principles of Justice as Fairness, including the Difference Principle, to average utilitarianism. In laying out the reasoning that favors the Difference Principle, Rawls argues that the parties will have reason to use the “maximin” rule. The maximin rule is a general rule for making choices under conditions of uncertainty. It is markedly different from the rule of maximizing expected value, the more “averaging” sort of rule that Harsanyi’s parties employ. The maximin rule directs one to select that alternative where the minimum place is higher (on whatever the relevant measure is) than the minimum place in any other alternative. Applied to the theory of social justice, maximin is an approach “a person would choose for the design of a society in which his enemy is to assign him his place.” TJ at 133.

The parties to Rawls’s OP are not “bare-persons” but “determinate-persons.” TJ at 152. They care about the primary goods and the highest-order moral powers, but they also know, in effect, that the primary goods that they are motivated to seek are not what the persons they represent ultimately care about. Accordingly, the parties will give special importance to protecting the persons they represent against social allocations of primary goods that might frustrate those persons’ ability to pursue their determinate conceptions of the good. If the parties knew they had in hand an adequate sketch of the good, they might use that to assess the gamble they face, choosing in a maximizing way like Harsanyi’s parties. But Rawls’s parties instead know that the primary goods that they are motivated to seek do not adequately match anyone’s conception of the good. Accordingly, it is rational for them to take a cautious approach. They must do what they can to assure to the persons they represent have a sufficient supply of primary goods for those persons to be able to pursue whatever it is that they do take to be good.

f. Reflective Equilibrium

Although the OP attempts to collect and express a set of crucial constraints that are appropriate to impose on the choice of principles of justice, Rawls recognized from the beginning that we could never just hand over the endorsement of those principles to this hypothetical device. Rather, he foresaw the need to “work from both ends,” pruning and adjusting things as we go. TJ at 18. That is, we need to stop and consider whether, on reflection, we can endorse the results of the OP. If those results clash with some of our more concrete considered judgments about justice, then we have reason to think about modifying the OP.

Alternatively—and this is what Rawls means by working “from both ends”—instead of modifying the OP, we might decide that the argument from the OP gives us good reason to modify the considered judgments of justice with which its conclusions clash. Eventually, we may hope that this process reaches a “reflective equilibrium.” If it does, Rawls wrote, “we shall find a description of the initial situation that matches our considered judgments duly pruned and adjusted.” Ibid.

The reflective equilibrium has been an immensely influential idea about moral justification. It is not a full theory of justification. When it was introduced, however, it suggested a different approach to justifying moral theories than was being commonly pursued. The idea of reflective equilibrium takes two steps away from the sort of conceptual analysis that was then prevalent. First, working on the basis of considered judgments suggests that it is not necessary to build moral theories on necessary or a priori premises. What matters, rather, is whether the premises are ones that “we do, in fact, accept.” TJ at 19. Rawls characterizes considered judgments as simply judgments reached under conditions where our sense of justice is likely to operate without distortion. TJ at 42. Second, the sort of pruning and adjusting that Rawls assumes will be involved in the search for reflective equilibrium implies that theories need not aim for a perfect fit with theory-independent “data.” Whereas the practitioners of conceptual analysis had raised to a fine art the method of generating counterexamples to a general theory, Rawls writes that “objections by way of counterexample are to be made with care.” TJ at 45. Checking a theory’s fit with one’s more concrete considered judgments is only a way-station on the route to reflective equilibrium. Reaching it might involve revising some of those more concrete judgments. A third novel idea about justification thus emerges from this picture: it involves arguments built in various different directions at once. The resulting justification, as Rawls puts it, “is a matter of the mutual support of many considerations.” TJ at 19, 507.

Eventually, the hope is that each person will reach a reflective equilibrium that coincides with every other person’s. Since it is up to each person, however, to determine which arguments are most compelling, Rawls stresses that the reader must make up his or her own mind, rather than trying to predict or anticipate what everyone else will think. TJ at 44.

g. Just Institutions

Part Two of TJ aims to show that Justice as Fairness fits our considered judgments on a whole range of more concrete topics in moral and political philosophy, such as the idea of the rule of law, the problem of justice between generations, and the justification of civil disobedience. Consistent with the idea of reflective equilibrium, Rawls suggests pruning and adjusting those judgments in a number of places. One of the thorniest such issues, that of tolerating the intolerant, recurs in PL. In addition to serving its main purpose of facilitating reflective equilibrium on Justice as Fairness, Part Two also offers a treasure trove of influential and insightful discussion of these and other topics in political philosophy. There is hardly space here even to summarize all the worthwhile points that Rawls makes about these topics. A summary of his controversial and influential discussion of the idea of desert (that is, getting what one deserves), however, will illustrate how he proceeds.

As we have seen, Rawls was deeply aware of the moral arbitrariness of fortune. He held that no one deserves the social position into which he or she is born or the physical characteristics with which he or she is endowed from birth. He also held that no one deserves the character traits he or she is born with, such as his or her capacity for hard work. As he wrote, “The natural distribution is neither just nor unjust; nor is it unjust that persons are born into society at some particular position. These are simply natural facts. What is just and unjust is the way that institutions deal with these facts.” TJ at 87.

In Part Two, Rawls sets out to square this stance on the moral arbitrariness of fortune with our considered judgments about desert, which do hold that desert is relevant to distributive claims. For instance, we tend to think that people who work harder deserve to be rewarded for their effort. We may also think that the talented deserve to be rewarded for the use of their talents, whether or not they deserved those talents in the first place. With these common-sense precepts of justice, Rawls does not disagree; but he clarifies them by responding to them dialectically. TJ at sec. 48. He questions whether these common-sense claims are meant to stand independently of any assumptions about whether or not the basic institutions of society—especially those institutions of property law, contract law, and taxation that, in effect, define the property claims and transfer rules that make up the marketplace—are just. It is unreasonable, Rawls argues, to say that desert is a direct basis for distributional claims even if the socio-economic system is unfair. It is much more reasonable to hold, he suggests, that whether one deserves the compensation one can command in the job marketplace, for instance, depends on whether the basic social institutions are fair. Are they set up so as to assure, among other things, an appropriate relationship between effort and reward? It is this justice of the basic structure that is Rawls’s topic.

Rawls’s alternative proposal is that the common-sense precepts about desert generally presuppose that the basic structure of society is itself fair. When they are qualified in line with this presupposition, Rawls supports them. To prevent the unqualified and the qualified claims from being confused with each other, however, he uses the term “legitimate expectations” as a term of art to express the claims of desert appropriately so qualified. A crucial idea of Justice as Fairness is that fundamental principles of justice must be respected for the rules of social cooperation to be fair, and that when they are, we should allow the free operation of the market largely to determine people’s legitimate expectations. (This dialectical clarification of the moral import of desert, however, did not satisfy all commentators. See Robert Nozick (1974).

h. Stability

In pursuing his novel topic of the justice of the basic structure of society, Rawls posed novel questions. One set of questions concerned what he calls the “stability” of those societies whose institutions live up to the requirements of a given set of principles of justice. The stability of the institutions called for by a given set of principles of justice—their ability to endure over time and to re-establish themselves after temporary disturbances—is a quality those principles must have if they are to serve their purposes.. TJ at 398-400. Unstable institutions would not secure the liberties, rights, and opportunities that the parties care about. If any set of institutions realizing a given set of principles were inherently unstable, that would suggest a need to revise those principles. Accordingly, Rawls argues, in Part Three of TJ, that institutions embodying Justice as Fairness would be stable – even more stable than institutions embodying the utilitarian principle.

In addressing the question of stability, Rawls never leaves behind the perspective of moral justification. Stability of a kind might be achieved by arranging a stand-off of opposing but equal armies. The results of such a balance of power are not of interest to Rawls. Rather, the stability question he asks concerns whether, in a society that conforms to the principles, citizens can wholeheartedly accept those principles. Wholeheartedness will require, for instance, that the reasons on the basis of which the citizens accept the principles are reasons affirmed by those very principles. PL at xlii. If stability can be grounded on such wholeheartedly moral reasons—as opposed to ulterior reasons—then it is “stability for the right reasons.” PL at xxxix. In TJ, the account of stability for the right reasons involved imagining that this wholeheartedness arose from individuals being thoroughly educated, along Kantian lines, to think of fairness in terms of the principles of Justice as Fairness. Cf. PL at lxii. As we will see, he later came to think that this account violated the assumption of pluralism.

The imaginative exercise of assessing the comparative stability of different principles would be useless and unfair if one were to compare, say, an enlightened and ideally-run set of institutions embodying Justice as Fairness with the stupidest possible set of institutions compatible with the utilitarian principle. In order to standardize the terms of comparison, Rawls discusses only the “well-ordered societies” corresponding to each of the rival sets of principles. His notion of a well-ordered society is complex. See CP at 232-5. The gist of it is that the relevant principles of justice are publicly accepted by everyone and that the basic social institutions are publicly known (or believed with good reason) to satisfy those principles.

Assessing the comparative stability of alternative well-ordered societies requires a complex imaginative effort at tracing likely phenomena of social psychology. As Rawls comments, “One conception of justice is more stable than another if the sense of justice that it tends to generate is stronger and more likely to override disruptive inclinations and if the institutions it allows foster weaker impulses and temptations to act justly.” CP at 398. In order to address the first of these issues, about the strength of the sense of justice, Chapter VIII develops a rich and somewhat original account of moral education. Drawing upon empirical research in developmental psychology, Rawls describes the gradual development of individuals’ senses of justice as involving three stages: the morality of authority, which is fostered in families; the morality of association; and the morality of principles. He argues that each of these stages of moral education will work more effectively under Justice as Fairness than it will under utilitarianism. TJ at chap. 8. He also argues that a society organized around the two principles of Justice as Fairness will be less prone to the disruptive effects of envy than will a utilitarian society. TJ at secs. 80-81.

i. Congruence

As we have seen, the veil of ignorance disconnects the argument from the OP from any given individual’s full conception of the good. The final question addressed by TJ attempts to reconnect justice to each individual’s good, not in general, but within the well-ordered society of Justice as Fairness. A stable society is one that generates attitudes, such as are encapsulated in an effective sense of justice, that support the just institutions of that society. If, in the well-ordered society, having those attitudes is also a good for the persons who have them, then there is a “match between justice and goodness” that Rawls calls “congruence.” TJ at 350.

In order to address this question of congruence, TJ develops an account of the good for individuals. Chapter VII of TJ, in fact, develops a quite general theory of goodness—called “goodness as rationality”—and then applies it to the special case of the good of an individual over a complete life. Rawls starts from the suggestion that “A is a good X if and only if A has the properties (to a higher degree than the average or standard X) which it is rational to want in an X, given what X’s are used for, or expected to do, and the like (whichever rider is appropriate).” TJ at 350-1. This idea, developed in dialogue with the leading alternatives from the middle of the 20th century, still repays attention. To work out this suggestion for the case of the good for persons, Rawls influentially developed and deployed the notion of a “life plan.” A rational plan of life for an individual, he argued, is answerable to certain principles of “deliberative rationality.” These Rawls sets out in a low-key way that masks the power and originality of his formulations. TJ at 359-72.

Rawls’s argument for congruence—that having an effective sense of justice built around the principles of Justice as Fairness will be a good for each individual—is a complex and philosophically deep one. It appeals to at least four types of intermediate good, each of which may be presumed to be of value to just about everyone: (i) the development and exercise of complex talents (which Rawls’s “Aristotelian Principle” presumes to be a good for human beings), TJ at 374, (ii) autonomy, (iii) community, and (iv) the unity of the self. Rawls’s argument for congruence is spread out across many sections of TJ. Some of its main threads are pulled together by Samuel Freeman in his contribution to The Cambridge Companion to Rawls. Freeman (2003). With regard to autonomy, to supplement the positive argument flowing from the Kantian interpretation of the OP, Rawls argues that the type of objectivity claimed for the principles of Justice as Fairness is not at odds with the idea of the autonomous establishment of principles. TJ at sec. 78. He further argues that Justice as Fairness supports the kind of tightly-knit community he calls “a social union of social unions,” marked by the shared purpose or “common aim of cooperating together to realize their own and another’s nature in ways allowed by the principles of justice.” TJ at 462. If Rawls is right about the congruence of goodness and justice, these “ways” are hardly trivial. (Not long after TJ was published, it came under attack by a set of critics who identified themselves as “communitarians,”  see for example MacIntyre (1984) and Sandel (1998). Ironically, the communitarian critique focused largely on Parts One and Two of TJ, giving short shrift to the powerful articulation of this ideal of community in Part Three.) Finally, regarding the unity of the self, Rawls criticizes the Procrustean sort of unity that could come from attaching oneself to a single “dominant end.” He notes the advantages of a conception of the unity of the self that hangs, instead, on the regulative status of principles of justice. TJ at secs. 83-85. The cumulative effect of these appeals to the development of talent, autonomy, community, and the unity of the self is to support the claim of Justice as Fairness to congruence. In a well-ordered society corresponding to Justice as Fairness, Rawls concludes, an effective sense of justice is a good for the individual who has it. In TJ, this congruence between justice and goodness is the main basis for concluding that individual citizens will wholeheartedly accept the principles of justice as fairness.

3. Recasting the Argument for Stability: Political Liberalism (1993)

Rawls has the parties to the OP assume that the society for which they are choosing principles is in the “circumstances of justice,” which include the presence of a plurality of irreconcilable moral, religious, and philosophical doctrines. But his argument for the comparative stability and the congruence of Justice as Fairness, imagines a well-ordered society in which everyone is brought up in ways deeply informed by the adherence by all adults to the same principles of justice. Accordingly, his discussion of stability and congruence in Part Three of TJ is at odds with the assumption of pluralism. In his second book, Political Liberalism [PL], he set out to rectify this “serious problem.” PL at xvii.

PL clarifies that the only acceptable way to rectify the problem is to modify the account of stability and congruence, because pluralism is no mere theoretical posit. Rather, pluralism has been endemic among the liberal democracies since the 16th century wars of religion. Moreover, pluralism is a permanent feature of liberal or non-repressive societies. It does not rest on irrationality. On the contrary, within a wide range such pluralism is “reasonable” and will not be erased by people’s attempts to cooperate reasonably. That is because a series of intractable “burdens of judgment” all but preclude reasoned convergence on fundamental and comprehensive principles about how to live. PL at 54-8. Accordingly, Rawls takes it as a fact that the kind of uniformity in fundamental moral and political beliefs that he imagined in Part Three of TJ can be maintained only by the oppressive use of state force. He calls this “the fact of oppression.” PL at 37. Since he also—unsurprisingly—holds that oppression is illegitimate, he refrains from offering fundamental and comprehensive principles of how to live. In this way, his insistence on the fact of oppression prompts a marked scaling back of the traditional aims of political philosophy.

The seminal idea of PL is “overlapping consensus.” In an overlapping consensus, each citizen—no matter which of society’s many “comprehensive conceptions” he or she endorses—ends up endorsing the same limited, “political conception” of justice, each for his or her own reasons. The principal role of the overlapping consensus is to replace TJ’s description of wholehearted acceptance. Unlike TJ’s description, the overlapping consensus conceptually reconciles wholehearted acceptance with the fact of reasonable pluralism.

Part of this newer approach is the distinction between “comprehensive conceptions,” which address all questions about how to live, and “political conceptions,” which address only political questions. This distinction has proven somewhat troublesome. The “domain of the political,” as Rawls calls it, is not completely distinct from morality. In concerning himself only with the political, he is not setting aside all moral principles and turning instead to mere strategy or Realpolitik. On the contrary, a political conception “is, of course, a moral conception,” but it is a moral conception that concerns itself only with the basic structure of society. PL at 11. Further, a political conception is one that may be developed in a “freestanding” way, drawing only upon the “very great values” of the political, rather than being presented as deriving from any more comprehensive moral or religious doctrine. PL at 139. A corollary of this approach is that such a political liberalism is not wholly neutral about the good. PL at 191-3. While Justice as Fairne