Category Archives: Value Misc.

The Meaning of Life: Early Continental and Analytic Perspectives

The question of the meaning of life is one that interests philosophers and non-philosophers alike. The question itself is notoriously ambiguous and possibly vague. In asking about the meaning of life, one may be asking about the essence of life, about life's purpose, about whether and how anything matters, or a host of other things.

Not everyone is plagued by questions about life's meaning, but some are. The circumstances in which one does ask about life's meaning include those in which: one is well off but bothered by either a sense of dissatisfaction or the prospect of bad things to come; one is young at heart and has a sense of wonder; one is perplexed by the discordant plurality of things and wants to find some unity in all the diversity; or one has lost faith in old values and narratives and wants to know how to live in order to have a meaningful life.

We may read our ancestors in such a way that warrants the claim that the meaning of life has been a human concern from the beginning. But it was only early in the nineteenth century that writers began to write directly about "the meaning of life." The most significant writers were: Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, and Tolstoy. Schopenhauer ended up saying that the meaning of life is to deny it; Kierkegaard, that the meaning of life is to obey God passionately; Nietzsche, that the meaning of life is the will to power; and Tolstoy, that the meaning of life lies in a kind of irrational knowledge called "faith."

In the twentieth century, in the Continental tradition, Heidegger held that the meaning of life is to live authentically or (alternatively) to be a guardian of the earth.  Sartre espoused the view that life is meaningless but urged us nonetheless to make a free choice that would give our lives meaning and responsibility. Camus also thought that life is absurd and meaningless. The best way to cope with this fact, he held, is to live life with passion, using everything up, and with an attitude of revolt, defiance, or scorn.

In the Anglo-American tradition, William James held that life is meaningful and worth living because of a spiritual order in which we should believe, or else that it is meaningful when there is a marriage of ideals with pluck, will, and the manly virtues; Bertrand Russell argued that to live a meaningful life one must abandon private and petty interests and instead cultivate an interest in the eternal; Moritz Schlick argued that the meaning of life is to be found in play; and A. J. Ayer asserted that the question of the meaning of life is itself meaningless.

All of these set the table for a veritable feast of philosophical writing on the meaning of life that began in the 1950s with Kurt Baier's essay "The Meaning of Life," followed in 1970 by Richard Taylor's influential essay on the same topic, followed shortly by Thomas Nagel's important 1971 essay on "The Absurd." See "Meaning of Life: The Analytic Perspective" for more on the course of the debate in analytic philosophy about the meaning of life.

Table of Contents

  1. Background
    1. The Origin of the English Expression "the Meaning of Life"
    2. Questions about the Meaning of Life
    3. The Broader Historical Background
  2. Nineteenth Century Philosophers
    1. Schopenhauer
    2. Kierkegaard
    3. Nietzsche
    4. Tolstoy
    5. Some Common Aspects of the Lives of Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, and Tolstoy
  3. Early Twentieth Century Continental Philosophers
    1. Heidegger
    2. Sartre
    3. Camus
  4. Early Twentieth Century Analytic, American, and English-Language Philosophers
    1. James
    2. Russell
    3. Schlick
    4. Tagore
    5. Ayer
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Background

a. The Origin of the English Expression "the Meaning of Life"

The English term "meaning" dates back to the fourteenth century C.E. Its origins, according to the Oxford English Dictionary (OED), lie in the Middle English word "meenyng" (also spelled "menaynge," "meneyng," and "mennyng").

In its earliest occurrences, in English original compositions as well as in English translations of earlier works, meaning is most often what, on the one hand, sentences, utterances, and stories, and, on the other hand, dreams, visions, signs, omens, and rituals have or might have. One asks about the meaning of some puzzling utterance, or of the writing on the wall, or of the vision that appeared to somebody in the night, or of the ritual performed on a hallowed occasion. Meaning is often conceived of as something non-obvious and somewhat secretive, discernible only by a seer granted with special powers.

It is much later that life is spoken of as something that might, or might not, have meaning in this sense. Such speech would have to wait upon the development of the concept of life as something like a word, a linguistic utterance, a narrative, a story, a gesture, a puzzling episode, a sign, a dream, a vision, or a surface phenomenon that points to some deep inner essence, to which it would be proper to inquire into its meaning, or to apply epithets like "meaningful" or "meaningless." One of the earliest instances of the occurrence of the concept "life" as such a thing, as signifying something that might or might not have something like meaning, appears in Shakespeare's Macbeth (c. 1605), where Macbeth characterizes life as "a tale told by an idiot, full of sound and fury, signifying nothing." But notice that even here the words "meaning" and "life" are not linked.

The OED's definition of "meaning" in something like our sense is "The significance, purpose, underlying truth, etc., of something." Further elaboration of early uses of the word gives us, "That which is indicated or expressed by a (supposed) symbol or symbolic action; spec. a message, warning, idea, etc., supposed to be symbolized by a dream, vision, omen, etc." A bit later, in one of its senses, meaning takes on the sense in which it is the "signification; intention; cause, purpose; motive, justification," . . . "[o]f an action, condition, etc." Finally we get the sense that most nearly concerns us here: "Something which gives one a sense of purpose, value, etc., esp. of a metaphysical or spiritual kind; the (perceived) purpose of existence or of a person's life. Freq. in the meaning of life." (All this is from the OED.)

The first English use of the expression "the meaning of life" appeared in 1834 in Thomas Carlyle's (1795-1881) Sartor Resartus II. ix, where Teufelsdrockh observes, "our Life is compassed round with Necessity; yet is the meaning of Life itself no other than Freedom." The usage shortly caught on, and over the next century and a half the phrase "the meaning of life" became common. The adjective "meaningful" did not appear until 1852, the noun "meaningfulness" until 1904.

b. Questions about the Meaning of Life

The most familiar form of the question(s) about the meaning of life is simply, "What is the meaning of life?" Although the form of the question is one, when it is asked, any one (or more) of several different senses may be intended. Here are some of the more common of them.

(1) In some cases, what the seeker seeks is the kernel, the inner reality, the core, or the essence, underlying some phenomenon. Thus one might ask what his essence, his true self is, and then feel that he has found the meaning of his life if he discovers that true self.

(2) In other cases, the question is about the point, aim, object, purpose, end, or goal of life, typically one's own. Here, in some cases, the question is about some pre-existing purpose that the questioner might (or might not) discover; in other cases, the question might be about some end or purpose the agent might invent or create and give her life. The latter questioner, when she is successful, may believe that her life has a meaning because she herself has given it one.

(3) In yet other cases, the question of the meaning of life is that of whether our lives, and anything we do within them, matter, or have any sort of importance. If one can show that they matter, and in virtue of what they do, one will have provided a substantive answer to the question of the meaning of life. A common, but not universal, assumption on this score is that our lives have significance and importance only if they issue in some lasting achievement the ravages of time will not destroy.

(4) In still other cases, what bothers the questioner is the discord, plurality, and chaotic nature of his apparent empirical life as it is actually lived. He can make no sense of it; there is no rhyme or reason to it. The drive here, one might well think, is to see one's life as intelligible, as something that makes sense. The discovery or invention of some kind of unity in his life would amount to an answer to his question, "What is the meaning of life?"

(5) Yet another thing the question about the meaning of life can be is a request for a narrative or picture, a way of seeing life (perhaps a metaphorical one) that enables one to make sense of it and achieve a sense of meaning while living it. And so we get "Life is a bowl of cherries" and various and sundry religious narratives.

(6) Sometimes what the questioner is really wondering is whether it makes sense to go on and his question is "Is life worth living?" He may actually be contemplating suicide. His predicament has to do with meaning if he is assuming that it makes sense to continue living only if (his) life has a suitable meaning, something which, at the moment, he can't see it as having.

(7) Finally, the question of the meaning of life can be the question of how one should live in order to have a meaningful life, or, if such a life is impossible, then what the best way to live meaninglessly is.

The seven questions just distinguished may be, but need not be, discrete and self-contained. A given seeker may very well be interested in several of them at once and see them as intimately connected. For example, a person may be interested in his core or essence because he thinks that knowledge of that may reveal the goal or purpose of his life, a purpose that makes his life seem important and intelligible, and gives him a reason for going on, as well as insight into how he must live in order to have a meaningful life. It is commonly the case that several of the questions press themselves on the seeker all at the same time.

One or more of these questions were of concern to the philosophers discussed below. Some were concerned with nearly all of them. Distinct from all the above are second-order, analytic, conceptual questions of the sort that dominate current philosophical discussion of the issue in analytic circles. These questions are not so much about the meaning of life as about the meaning of "the meaning of life" and its component concepts ("meaning," "life"), or related ones ("meaningfulness," "meaninglessness," "vanity," "absurdity," and so forth).

c. The Broader Historical Background

Although nineteenth century thinkers were the first in the West to put the question precisely in the form "What is the meaning of life?" concern with questions in what may be called "the meaning-of-life family," that is, ultimate questions about life, the world, existence, and its purpose may be found, in the East and the West alike, almost as far back as we can trace human thought about anything. Thus Gilgamesh (c. 2000 B.C.E.) asked why he must die; the composers of The Rig Veda (c. 1200 B.C.E.) wondered where everything came from; Job (c. 500 B.C.E.) asked why he must suffer; the ancient Taoists (Laozi c. 500 B.C.E. and Zhuangzi c. 300 B.C.E.) asked what the origin or principle of everything is, and how one must live to be in accord with it; ancient Upanishadic seekers (500-300 B.C.E.) were much vexed with the nature of the true self and its end or goal; the Buddha (c. 500 B.C.E.), before he became the Buddha, sought an understanding of life that would enable one to overcome suffering; the author of The Bhagavad Gita (c. 200 B.C.E.) was concerned, as other Indian thinkers tended to be, with the identity and nature of the true self, and also with the question of how to live; the ancient Greeks of the classical period (c. 430-320 B.C.E.) talked about the goal or end of life and how to reach it; Epicurus (341-270 B.C.E.) followed suit and developed his own unique take on these matters; Qoheleth, the author of Ecclesiastes (c. 200 B.C.E.), was struck by the vanity or futility of everything and wondered how to deal with it; Greek and Roman Hellenistic philosophers (c. 300 B.C.E. - 250 C.E.)—Epicurean, Stoic, Cynic, Skeptic, and Neo-Platonist—wondered about the good and how to achieve it; Marcus Aurelius (121-180 C.E.) mused on his cosmic insignificance.

The Christian-dominated medieval period did not produce thinkers who asked in any radical way about the meaning of life, because everyone already had a perfectly good answer, the one provided by the Christian story. Still, even in medieval times, there was room for at least three questions in the meaning-of-life family. First, there was occasion for the questions when things ran counter to the Christian story, or to what one expected. Thus Boethius (480-525) was perplexed by the deep questions when, after a life of honor, piety, and power, he fell into disgrace, had everything stripped from him unaccountably and unjustly, and found himself faced with imprisonment that lead eventually to his execution. Second, though the great Christian philosopher-theologians thought they knew the meaning of life in outline, they still asked and answered questions about the details of the final or highest good of man. Thomas Aquinas (1224-1274), for example, who accepted with unblinking assurance the general answer supplied by Christianity, found himself wondering about the exact nature of the summum bonum (the highest good) and about how to square the Christian view of it with that of Aristotle. Third, other Christian believers, medieval ones as well as present-day ones with medieval outlooks, committed to an overall view of what is going on, may be vexed by the question of what God intends for them specifically and may worry about their "calling," the particular purpose, role, or plan God has especially for them. Hence we find confirmed believers worried deeply about the question, "What is the meaning of my life?"

In any event, since the early modern period, there has been a resurgence of interest in fundamental meaning-of-life questions. Writers as diverse as Shakespeare (1564-1616), Pascal (1623-1662), Dr. Johnson (1709-84), Kant (1724-1804), and Hegel (1770-1831) have asked, in different forms, questions about life's ultimate point, goal, or purpose, and they are just a few of the many religious, philosophical, and literary figures who have raised and (sometimes) answered ultimate questions in the meaning-of-life family prior to Schopenhauer's work early in the nineteenth century. There have been philosophers too since Schopenhauer's time who have addressed the big questions, but not explicitly in terms of "the meaning of life." This article will confine itself largely to those philosophers who have explicitly put their concerns in those terms.

The standard explanation of the rise of questions about life's meaning in the early modern period points to three or four distinct but related things: (1) the scientific revolution; (2) the Protestant Reformation; (3) voyages and travels of exploration and discovery, in which were encountered peoples with very different outlooks on the nature of the universe and the meaning of life; and (4), as a result of all of these, the evaporation of a widely held, firmly believed Christian conception of the nature of things.

2. Nineteenth Century Philosophers

Let us turn now to the story of what philosophers from Schopenhauer in the early 1800s to Ayer and Camus in the 1940s have had to say about the meaning of life.

a. Schopenhauer

The first Western philosopher to link the ideas of life and meaning, and to ask expressly "What is the meaning of life?" was the great German pessimist Arthur Schopenhauer (1788-1860). At least he was the first to ask the question and get it noticed by other philosophers. Schopenhauer, a contemporary of Carlyle, wrote in German, in which "the meaning of life" is "der Sinn des Lebens." Profoundly influencing the thought of both Nietzsche and Tolstoy, Schopenhauer's work may be regarded as the springboard that launched modern Western philosophical inquiry into the problem of the meaning of life. Here is the passage in which Schopenhauer explicitly asked the question:

Since a man does not alter, and his moral character remains absolutely the same all through his life; since   he must play out the part which he has received, without the least deviation from the character; since   neither experience, nor philosophy, nor religion can effect any improvement in him, the question arises, What is the meaning of life at all? (1860b) [emphasis added]

The circumstances under which concern with the problem of the meaning of life were, in Schopenhauer's case, not merely academic but real and personal. Well off financially, but struggling with personal misery and a sense of loneliness and isolation, he felt driven to find some understanding of himself and of the world around him that seemed so bleak and senseless.

Schopenhauer's philosophy begins with a metaphysical structure he inherited from Kant and more or less simply decrees. There is a difference between the thing-in-itself and the phenomenal world of appearances. The thing-in-itself is the will to live, or, more simply, the will. It is the fundamental power and reality that underlies all things. The world we know and live in, with its stupendous abundance of things and forms, is merely the phenomena of the will, the objectification of it, its mirror, something not entirely real, or not real at all. (There is also a pure, will-less subject of knowledge whose metaphysical status is unclear: sometimes it seems to be in the very realm of the will, the realm of true reality, of things-in-themselves; at other times it seems to be something like the first creation and objectification of the will.)

The will itself just wills. It is pretty nasty, perhaps demonic. It is a blind striving, craving, and grasping, aiming at nothing in the end, except to go on willing and aggrandizing itself. It has in itself an inner contradiction, manifest in the constant struggle and strife between the billions of individual objectifications of itself in the phenomenal world. I am one such objectification; you are another. My true self, my inner essence, is the will; the same is true of you: my essence and yours are one and the same. When we fight (as we usually do), the will is engaged in a battle with itself.

The phenomenal world is an awful place. It is full of misery, pain, suffering. Little happiness is found anywhere. The twin poles of human life are pain (want, desire, stress) and boredom. Almost everyone lives a life that, from without, is meaningless and insignificant and, from within, dull and senseless.

But what is the meaning of life? The question is appropriate because life as we know it is something like Macbeth's tale told by an idiot, a "farce." If the question is about life's inner essence, Schopenhauer's answer is simply "the will-to-live." The meaning of life is the will.

Another way of taking the question "What is the meaning of life?" is to construe it as a question about the goal, point, aim, end, or purpose of life. When Schopenhauer explicitly asks the question (in On Human Nature), it is this sense of it he appears to have in mind. His answer is depressing. The point or purpose of life is to suffer. We are being punished for the crime of being born, punished for who we are, namely, the nasty thoroughly egoistic will. The meaning of life in this sense, then, is to suffer, to be punished for our sin.

Schopenhauer suggests a number of ways of thinking about our phenomenal, experienced life. All of them are pretty bleak. He recommends that we look upon our life: as an unprofitable episode interrupting the blessed calm of nothingness; as on the whole a disappointment, nay, a cheat; as Hell, in which on the one hand men are the tormented souls and on the other the tormenting devils; as a place of atonement, a sort of penal colony; as some kind of mistake; and as a process of disillusionment. Any or all of these could be taken as answers to the question "What is the meaning of life?" (or to the question "What is life?")

If we ask what we should do, how we can give our lives worth and meaning, Schopenhauer does have an answer. "Salvation" lies in the total denial of the will. Knowledge of the will and its horrific phenomena can and should function as a quieter of the will, bringing it to a state in which it stops willing and effectively abolishes itself. Thinking in this vein, a Schopenhauerian might say that the meaning of life is to deny, quiet, and eventually abolish the will to live that is essentially oneself.

One naturally wants to know whether this is not just suicide—whether the cessation of willing simply means that one passes into a state of nothingness. Schopenhauer's answer is "No." The state of the will-less individual after death seems to be nothing to us; but our present state would seem to be nothing to him. His state is wonderful and blessed, but what it is like is inconceivable to us.

In our current state, when one denies the will in herself, she does not literally commit suicide. Suicide doesn't work because it is itself a powerful act of willing. Instead, she practices self-denial and asceticism, cultivates detachment, stops wanting and pursuing the things most people go for; and although there is still some struggle with the dying will in her, on the whole her life becomes full of peace and joy. The will is quieted and eventually abolishes itself in the individual. Very few people are capable of doing this heroic thing, Schopenhauer says, but he himself does not claim to be one of these people.

For all the darkness of his philosophy, the moral for all of us—even those of us who are not prepared to totally deny the will—which Schopenhauer derives in the end is very much in the Christian/Buddhist vein. We should not be competitive or grasping or villainous, but rather we should show compassion and kindness to everyone, since everyone is always having a bad day in this hell we are all living in, and what we all need above all are love, compassion, help, and consideration. The fundamental principle of morality, which you should follow, is: Don't hurt anyone; help everyone you can. Following this principle, one can achieve, short of complete denial of the will, a kind of half-way salvation.

Another of Schopenhauer's points about meaning in life should be mentioned. It is that the meaningfulness of one's life depends not on one's outer circumstances but rather on the way one looks at life. People look at life differently, and so the meaningfulness of her life varies considerably from person to person. To one person life is barren, dull, and superficial; to another rich, interesting, and full of meaning.

b. Kierkegaard

A major nineteenth century European philosopher who continued the tradition of thought on the meaning of life was the Danish philosopher Soren Kierkegaard (1813-1855). Kierkegaard was not an academic. The sources of his interest in problems of meaning seem to have been his not having to work for a living, his personal demons, his Nordic gloom, his congenital tendencies toward guilt, depression, anxiety, and dread, his awareness of increasing doubt all around him of the teachings of his inherited Christianity, and his agonizing failure to live up to his own Christian ideals, primarily because of his embodiment and its concomitant proclivity for the things of the flesh, especially sensuousness and sex.  Out of all that emerged what appears to be a severe case of self-loathing, which in turn prompted serious inquiry into the meaning of (his) life.

It is difficult to determine what Kierkegaard's own views were on just about everything because he constantly used humor, satire, paradox, and irony, and even more because he spoke in different voices and wrote from different perspectives under different pseudonyms.

Nonetheless, the standard view is that Kierkegaard was fundamentally a Christian. He claimed that one's life can be meaningful and worth living only if one believes genuinely and passionately in the Christian God.

And then there is the leap. Christian belief goes beyond rational evidence, and even conflicts with it. One must make a leap from knowledge to Christian faith—the only thing in which one can find true meaning—a leap over the confines of common sense and reason. One is to accept Christian faith even if (or just because?) it is absurd. For it is the only adequate source of the kind of meaning a human being has to have to keep on going with a sense that life is worthwhile.

Another way to describe Kierkegaard's overall philosophy is to characterize it in terms of his three stages or levels of life. One should make an ascent from the lowest stage, the aesthetic (sensuous, even sensual), through the higher ethical stage, and on to the highest stage of all, the religious, which somehow baptizes and incorporates the two lower stages into itself. Only one who has reached the religious stage can have a truly meaningful life and thus a life worth living.

Whatever Kierkegaard's own view was, we can make the following observations about things Kierkegaard (or one or other of his pseudonymous authors) said about the meaning of life.

(1) One thing is that life can seem meaningless. In the early work, Either/Or (1843), we find this passage: "How empty and meaningless life is." Elsewhere in Either/Or we get similar thoughts and questions, for instance, "What, if anything, is the meaning of this life?" and "My life is utterly meaningless." Perhaps, though, the idea is that, though life is often meaningless, it need not be so, and, when it is, it is because of some kind of failure of the liver (of the life, not the organ).

(2) A second interesting idea in Kierkegaard is that meaning has something to do with unity. In a meaningful life all the diverse aspects of it come together to form some kind of coherent whole. One pursues some one goal, to which everything in one's life is subordinated.

(3) A third point, an important one, is that, though meaning is a good thing, it is possible for there to be too much meaning in one's life, or in its parts. Kierkegaard observes:

 No part of life ought to have so much meaning for a person that he cannot forget it any moment he wants to; on the other hand, every single part of life ought to have so much meaning for a person that he can     remember it at any moment. (Either/Or)

To have one's life full of meaning to the brim, to regard life and everything one does in it as infinitely significant, brings with it so much pressure and stress that one's life becomes unbearable.

To me [says Kierkegaard] it seems . . . that to be known in time by God makes life enormously strenuous. Everywhere where he is present each half hour is of infinite importance. Yet to live like that for sixty years is unsupportable. It is difficult enough putting up even with the three years’ hard study for an examination, and those are still not as strenuous as half an hour like this. (Concluding Unscientific Postscript)

(4) A fourth idea about meaning in Kierkegaard is the idea that one can give one's life meaning, or that one can acquire meaning in life, by doing something like devoting oneself to something. Of Antigone he says, "her life acquires meaning for her in its devotion to showing him [her father, after his death] the last honors daily, almost hourly, by her unbroken silence." (Either/Or)

(5) Meaning does not come from abstract, objective knowledge of any kind, whether philosophical, or scientific, or historical, or even theological. It comes from some kind of faith, a faith that is passionately acquired and lived daily.

(6) One twentieth century approach to the problem of the meaning of life is to see, accept, and bask more or less happily in the absurdity of life. Kierkegaard anticipated this approach prophetically in his characterization of the "humorist." Kierkegaard writes: "Weary of time and its endless succession, the humorist runs away and finds humorous relief in stating the absurd." (Concluding Unscientific Postscript)

(7) Kierkegaard's humorist also at one point expresses a view which is surprisingly rare, namely, the view that one's life may have a meaning, but one doesn't know what it is. Kierkegaard writes: “[L]et a humorist say what he has in mind and he will speak, for example, as follows: What is the meaning of life? Yes, good question. How should I know?" (Concluding Unscientific Postscript)

(8) Although Kierkegaard himself was a Christian who viewed meaning as ultimately grounded in religious faith, in one's personal relation to a supernatural God, yet, paradoxically perhaps, and certainly in an admirable spirit of non-exclusivity, he said:

It is possible both to enjoy life and to give it meaning and substance outside Christianity, just as the most    famous poets and artists, the most eminent of thinkers, even men of piety, have lived outside Christianity (Concluding Unscientific Postscript).

(9) One finds in Kierkegaard the idea that life has meaning only insofar as it is related in some way to the Infinite. Nothing finite can supply the meaning of life.

On the whole, if for no other reason, Kierkegaard's work is valuable because of its suggestiveness. Under one pseudonym or another, Kierkegaard made many important points which were taken up, or unfortunately overlooked, by subsequent philosophers concerned with the meaning of life.

c. Nietzsche

Friedrich Nietzsche (1844-1900) cut his philosophical teeth on Schopenhauer and devoted himself in his later works—from 1883 up to the onset of insanity in January 1889—to struggle with, among other things, the meaning of life.

Nietzsche's grand project was the revaluation of all values. Part of this project was that of giving to life a new meaning. Nietzsche's interest in the matter was not merely academic. Coming up with new values and giving life a new meaning was a project that involved a total transformation of Nietzsche's own self, early versions of which he became dissatisfied with. One thing Nietzsche wanted to do was to produce an affirmative philosophy of life to replace Schopenhauer's pessimistic, life-denying philosophy.

Nietzsche rejected Schopenhauer's picture of life as suffering, or punishment for one's sin, together with its ethic of compassion toward the poor and the sick. Such a picture belonged to a weak, sick, decadent, nay-saying mode of being in decline. Nietzsche himself wanted to produce a positive, healthy, life-affirming philosophy, one suitable for life in the ascendant.

Sometimes, particularly early in his writings, Nietzsche seemed to think some end or other is required to make things meaningful. At times, both early and late, Nietzsche spoke as though the very concept of the meaning of something is the concept of its end, object, or goal.

In other places, however, Nietzsche spoke as if the meaning of life lies in freedom from, not in the achievement of, ends. Perhaps this should be construed as the rejection of given ends to be discovered, not in the rejection of all ends, particularly those one creates. Moritz Schlick—whose thought we will consider in more detail later—claimed that Nietzsche saw that life has no meaning so long as it stands wholly under the domination of purposes. In Nietzsche's Zarathustra, "Sir Hazard," expressing Nietzsche's own considered view, says, "I have saved them from the slavery of ends." (Klemke, 3rd ed., 63).

Nietzsche sometimes spoke as if life, before he came into it, or before he revaluated all values, had no meaning: "Sombre is human life, and as yet without meaning: a buffoon may be fateful to it" (Thus Spake Zarathustra, 1883). There is no meaning "out there" to be discovered, no meaning in the essences of things, apart from human will, desire, perspective. In fact, apart from perspective, there is no world out there at all, no "thing-in-itself," no "facts-in-themselves." But a psychologically strong person can do without things in themselves and meaning (already there) to be discovered in them. That is because he can organize a small part of the world himself and thus create meaning. In The Will to Power, Nietzsche speaks of "the creative strength to create meaning," and he says:

It is a measure of the degree of strength of will to what extent one can do without meaning in things, to what extent one can endure to live in a meaningless world because one organizes a small portion of it oneself. (The Will to Power)

Whatever the meaning of life is, or is to be, it is terrestrial, not celestial. Meaning must not be placed in some fabricated "true world" but in this very earth in which we live and have our being. And the meaning of life is to be created, not discovered.

Still, somehow, man is not the meaning and measure of all things, though he has posited himself as such.

All the values by means of which we have tried so far to render the world estimable for ourselves and which then proved inapplicable and therefore devaluated the world—all these values are, psychologically considered, the results of certain perspectives of utility, designed to maintain and increase human constructs of domination—and they have been falsely projected into the essence of things. What we find here is still the hyperbolic naiveté of man: positing himself as the meaning and measure of the value of things. (The Will to Power)

The mistake lies in projecting our own values onto reality, in thinking that our meaning and values are present in things as such. But our meaning does not lie in "things-in-themselves." It is created by us. If we then give things out there such and such a meaning, we should recognize that it is not a meaning we have found in the things themselves, but rather one that we have given them.

We can still ask, What is the meaning of life? What is the meaning we shall give to life? Nietzsche gives two different answers. One is that the meaning of life is the Übermensch (sometimes translated as ‘Superman’), Nietzsche's post-human creator of meaning, affirmer of life, and bearer of values.

I want to teach men the sense of their existence, which is the Superman, the lightning out of the dark cloud—man. (Thus Spake Zarathustra)

The Superman is the meaning of the earth. Let your will say: The Superman SHALL BE the meaning of the earth! (Thus Spake Zarathustra)

The other answer is that the meaning of life is the will to power.

All meaning is will to power. (The Will to Power)

On the surface these two answers are different. But perhaps they are consistent. Perhaps what the will to power generates is the Superman, or what the Superman represents is the will to power. Again, perhaps the will to power is the meaning of life in the sense of its kernel or essence, while the Superman is its meaning in the sense of its end or goal.

Nietzsche's view has some aspects or consequences that should be noted. One consequence of Nietzsche's view is that the meaning of life is absent in the old and the sick. He acknowledged the fact. Another consequence (or perhaps component) of Nietzsche's view is that nihilism, the denial of all value, is a transitional stage, not the finale. Yet another consequence is that the meaning of life is not about the predominance of pleasure over pain. Concern with that evidences only nihilism. Finally, it may be conjectured that Nietzsche would probably regard with scorn those of us in the current debate among academic philosophers about the meaning of life. He would consider us "minute" philosophers:

The study of the minute philosophers is only interesting for the recognition that they have reached those stages in the great edifice of philosophy where learned disquisitions for and against, where hair-splitting objections and counter-objections are the rule: and for that reason they evade the demand of every great philosophy to speak sub specie aeternitatis. (Nietzsche, 1874)

d. Tolstoy

One of the next thinkers in the Western intellectual tradition to ask seriously the question, "What is the meaning of life?" was the great Russian novelist and moralist Count Leo Tolstoy (1828-1910). He asked the question and offered part of an answer in A Confession, written in Russian in 1879, circulated in 1882, and translated and published in 1884. Tolstoy's reflections on the question stimulated a great deal of subsequent debate on the issue.

Although characters in his earlier works, such as War and Peace, sometimes talked about the meaning of life and felt the problem deeply, Tolstoy himself raised serious questions about it only as part of a psychological crisis he underwent in the mid to late 1870s. Despite having everything anyone could ever want—wealth, fame, status, love, physical strength, and so forth—Tolstoy found himself severely disturbed. His symptoms were depression, psychological paralysis, obsession with suicide, and the continual recurrence in his head of the question of the meaning of life.

Tolstoy put his question about the meaning of life in several different ways. Here are some of them, listed in order of their occurrence in his Confession:

What is it for? What does it lead to? Why? What then? What for? But what does it matter to me? What of it? Why go on making any effort? How go on living? What will come of what I am doing today or shall do tomorrow? What will come of my whole life? Why should I live, why wish for anything, or do anything? Is there any meaning in my life that the inevitable death awaiting me does not destroy? What am  I, with my desires? Why do I live? What must I do? What is the meaning of my life? Why do I exist?

Several of these seem to be quite different questions, but Tolstoy regarded them all as the same question put in different ways.

Tolstoy said explicitly that his question was not about the composition, origin, and fate of the universe, nor again about the question, "What is the life of the whole?" That question, Tolstoy said, is unanswerable for a single man, and it is "stupidity" to think an individual must first answer the question about the meaning of the universe or the whole of humanity before he can answer the question of the meaning of his own life.

Tolstoy came to think that he should not expect to find the answers to his questions in philosophy. The legitimate task of philosophy is merely to ask the question and perhaps refine and clarify it, not to answer it, which it cannot do.

This view of philosophy as incapable of providing answers to the questions of life must have been one Tolstoy came to some way into his crisis. At another point, apparently earlier, Tolstoy did try to find answers in philosophy (as well as in the mathematical, physical, biological, and social sciences). The philosophers he studied were Socrates, the Buddha, "Solomon" (the author of Ecclesiastes), and Schopenhauer.

All of these he interpreted as providing a negative answer. The gist of Socrates' thought is that the true philosopher seeks death, because the life of the body, with all its ailments and desires, is an impediment to what he is really all about, namely, the quest for truth. The individual life of the physically discrete individual is pretty meaningless, something one would rather do without. The Buddha, as Tolstoy read him, teaches that life is the greatest of evils and works as hard as he can to free himself from it. "Solomon" teaches that it's all "vanity." And Schopenhauer, as Tolstoy understood him, wishes for, and advocates, annihilation.

In a nutshell, Tolstoy's problem was this: since I will suffer, die, be forgotten, and make no difference (leave no trace) in the long run, how does my life, or anything I do, have any meaning? It was a problem he felt deeply. He had to have an answer to go on living. Tolstoy's concern with the issue was not merely theoretical.

The solution to the problem that Tolstoy eventually came to was one he thought had been known all along by the unlearned peasants. The solution lies in a kind of irrational knowledge called "faith." Faith is faith in God, and lived faith involves some kind of relation to the Infinite. Meaning is found in the appropriate relationship to God, the Infinite. Tolstoy's solution bears obvious resemblances to Kierkegaard's and is very much in the same spirit.

Tolstoy spent the rest of his life working out the details of, or variations on, this solution. The progress of his thought can be traced in What I Believe and On Life, as well as in his late short fiction (The Death of Ivan Ilych, Father Sergius, and so forth). To the end Tolstoy held that faith in God, work, service to others, unselfishness, and love are essential parts of a meaningful life. He taught that the things ordinarily pursued by many—wealth, status, power, fame—contribute nothing to the meaningfulness of life.

e. Some Common Aspects of the Lives of Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, and Tolstoy

Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, and Tolstoy all had lives which rendered them virtual breeding grounds for problems with the meaning of life. (1) All of them were well off and did not have to work for a living; there is no evidence that any of them ever felt a real threat of, say, homelessness or starvation. Nietzsche was the one that wasn't exactly wealthy, but in his case his early retirement (in his late twenties) provided him with a pension for life sufficient to meet his material needs and free him up for a life of thought and writing. (2) All of them suffered from psychological illness of one sort or another—at the very least, a sense of gloom or melancholy, and in some cases a sense of worthlessness and a preoccupation with suicide, or feelings of dread and anxiety, or the encroachment of outright madness. (3) All of them grew up in religious environments, the tenets of which they lost faith in when they reached adulthood, and the lack of which they struggled with throughout their lives (eventually regaining, in the cases of Kierkegaard and Tolstoy, some portion of what they had lost). (4) None of them was a professional academician, except for Nietzsche in his youth.

From these four, and from our own experiences of life, we have inherited, to the extent that we have it, our preoccupation with the meaning of life.

3. Early Twentieth Century Continental Philosophers

In the early twentieth century questions about the meaning of life continued to be of interest to leading European or "Continental" philosophers.   

a. Heidegger

The great German philosophy professor Martin Heidegger (1889-1976) was certainly concerned with the meaning of life. He presented two different outlooks, which we may call "early Heidegger" and "later Heidegger.”

For early Heidegger (that is, the Heidegger of Being and Time, 1927), the question of the meaning of life is the question how we can live an "authentic" life, one that is our life, not just the life for us that has been fixed by the community we live in. His answer is that to live a meaningful life is to live a life of authenticity. To live a life authenticity is to live a life that one oneself chooses, not the life that is prescribed for one by one's social situation. To live a life of authenticity, one must have a plan, something that unifies one's life into an organic whole. This is one's own plan. So a meaningful life is one of focused authenticity. "Authenticity is Heidegger's accounted of what it is to live a meaningful life."

Living authentically, it turns out, is a matter of living in a way that is true to your heritage. "Being true to heritage is being true to your own, deepest self." In the end, the content of authenticity is not something you freely choose ex nihilo, but rather something you discover in the conjunction of heritage and facticity.

Early Heidegger's thought seems to be a kind of pantheism, and it is possible that Heidegger subscribed to some such view all his life.

Later Heidegger proposes a somewhat different view. In this philosophy of his, we are given the task, in which our meaning lies, of being "guardians of the world." The world is a holy place. To understand and appreciate that fact is to exhibit not just a certain intellectual and practical stance toward the world, but to live with an attitude of respect and reverence toward the world, toward the natural world especially. Later Heidegger saw exploitation of the natural world, as in mining and highway-building, as deplorable, as contrary to the very meaning of life. The meaning of life is guardianship of the world.

b. Sartre

The French philosopher Jean-Paul Sartre (1905-1980) changed his views over the course of his life. In his work Being and Nothingness (1943), advocated an outlook from which life is absurd. We more or less seriously pursue goals which, from a detached standpoint, we can see don't really matter. But we continue to act as though they do, and hence our lives are absurd. The Sartrean project is to overcome this detached standpoint, or to incorporate it into our lives.

The problem is other people. They insist on their own reality. They tend to get in the way of our pursuit of our own goals.

Later on, Sartre espoused a somewhat different view. On this new view, "our fundamental goal in life is to overcome our 'contingency'," to become the foundation of our own being. The main obstacle (again) is other people who, on the one hand, pursue their own (different) goals and, on the other, propose a real (military) threat to one's way of life and one's homeland.

In his 1944 play, No Exit, there is the famous line: "Hell is other people." Other people do not cooperate with my projects, and I do not cooperate with theirs. The result is war, in something like Schopenhauer's sense. People are always at war, or at least at odds, with each other.

In both his early and his later thought, Sartre ends up being pretty pessimistic and depressing. Life is meaningless. We can, by our free choice, give life some meaning or other. But the decision to do so is itself a matter of ungrounded free choice, which is such that it doesn't matter whether that decision or some other one is made.

c. Camus

Albert Camus (1913-1960), a Frenchman born in Algeria, was one of the leading existentialists (though he himself disowned the label) and one of the more influential writers of the first half of the twentieth century. He was familiar with the work of Nietzsche, and greatly influenced by it.

On our theme, Camus's starting point was the perception of the absurd. Human life, he felt, was absurd, meaningless, and senseless. The way in which it is, or the reason it is, lies in an inevitable clash between the needs and aspirations of human beings and the cold, meaningless world.

This clash has at least four facets. First, we seek—demand, even—a rational understanding of things, some way of seeing the world as familiar to us. But the world does not cooperate: to us, it is ultimately unintelligible. Second, we long for some kind of unity underlying and organizing the manifest diversity we find all around us. But again, the world is heedless of our longings. The world that presents itself to our senses is nothing but disjointed plurality. Third, we long for a higher reality (a God, for example), something transcendent, some cosmic meaning of everything. But no such meaning can be discerned. Fourth, we strive for continued life, or at least to achieve something permanent in the end. But our efforts are pointless, everything will come to nothing, and all that lies ahead is death and oblivion.

Our situation is like that of the mythical Greek of old, Sisyphus. We are condemned, as it were, to pushing a rock up a hill, over and over only to see it roll back down again, every time, when it reaches the top. Pointless labor is Sisyphus' lot, and ours too.

The pointlessness and absurdity of life raise the question of suicide. Should we kill ourselves? Camus's answer is that, no, we should not. Suicide is escapist. To kill yourself is to give in, to lose. If we were prisoners of war—which is something like what we are—our captor and tormentor would want us to do exactly that—confess that things are too much for us and kill ourselves. That would be his ultimate victory, which would bring him a chuckle, or perhaps even a hearty guffaw.

How then should we live? The first thing to do is to insist that life is better if there is no meaning. That would really irritate our tormentor. Second, we should cultivate a mindset of honesty and lucidity. We should not indulge in denial, or evasion, or imaginings of an eventual escape into an afterlife where everything will be put right. We should acknowledge that life is awful—but then, perhaps, add "and I love it" or "all is well." Third, we should take up an attitude of revolt, defiance, and scorn. Camus observes, "There is no fate that cannot be surmounted by scorn." Surely such an attitude would vex our hypothetical tormentor beyond measure. Fourth, we should live for now, stop worrying about the future, stop striving to achieve future goals. Nothing is going to come of anything we do in the long run anyway. Fifth, we should "use everything up": work hard, play hard, approach everything with zest and passion, expend energy to the human limit. This amounts to a kind of perverse "Yes!" to life. Finally, we may ask why anyone would want to live like this? Is it something that would appeal only to the French? What are the advantages of such an attitude toward life?

Camus has answers to these queries, three in fact. First, living as he recommends is a way of salvaging our dignity, and it is a way to which a certain majesty adheres. Second, surprisingly perhaps, such a way of living brings with it a "curious joy." Third, it is the way of freedom. Camus's scornful existentialism is the best conception we have of a truly free human being, one who does not allow himself to be shaped and determined by the mindless, meaningless world that surrounds him.

4. Early Twentieth Century Analytic, American, and English-Language Philosophers

 Anglo-American philosophers in the very late eighteenth and early twentieth centuries continued to be interested in problems of the meaning of life as well.

a. James

The American pragmatist philosopher William James (1842-1910), a Harvard professor, wrote a couple of interesting essays on our theme in the late 1890s. Both essays were written as addresses to be delivered to live audiences. They demand some discussion and consideration.

In "Is Life Worth Living?" (1895), James reveals deep, probably first-person, familiarity, with the existential source of concern with the issues of the meaning and worthwhileness of life. He calls it the "profounder bass-note of life" and suggests that it is to be found, or heard, somewhere in all of us: "In the deepest heart of all of us there is a corner in which the ultimate mystery of things works sadly." (1895: 32)

Some people are so naturally optimistic and in love with life that they are constitutionally incapable of being much bothered by the bass-note and pay it little attention. James's example of such a person is Walt Whitman; and one thinks of the English. James finds no fault—intellectual, moral, or otherwise—with such people. It is rare good fortune to be blessed with such a temperament. If everyone were, the question of the worthwhileness of life would never arise.

But for every Whitman, there is a suicide, and a thinker of the dreary constitution of the poet James Thomson, author of "The City of Dreadful Night."

In his address, James imagines himself in discussion with a would-be suicide whom he tries to persuade to take up his burden and see life through to its natural end. James acknowledges that some of these suicides—perhaps the majority of them—are too far gone to have anything said to them, for instance, those whose suicidal impulses are due to insanity or sudden fits of frenzy. It is to the class of reflective would-be suicides—those disposed to kill themselves because of their thinking, reading, and brooding on the darker side of life—that James directs his remarks. It is these he wants to cheer up (or comfort) and keep alive.

James speaks of two stages of recovery from suicidal illness. The first stage includes three elements, three palliatives, for the suicidal condition. First, there is the thought, "You can end it whenever you will." This strikes one as a strange thought to recommend to one contemplating suicide. But James thinks the thought can be a comfort. It means there's no particular guilt or stigma attached to suicide. It means one won't have to put up with this miserable world forever; one can opt out whenever one wants. It may delay the act by encouraging the thought, "Why kill myself today when I can always do it tomorrow?" Second, James points out, there is in human beings a natural sense of curiosity. It is worth hanging around a while longer in order to see the headlines of tomorrow's newspaper. Third, there is a certain fighting instinct in human beings. James thinks the normal man has a reason to go on, even if the whole thing is worthless and meaningless, as long as there is some injustice to be put right, some villain to be put down, or some evil to overcome in the little corner of the universe he inhabits. The three things just mentioned all lie in the first stage of recovery, one that is partial and inferior to what lies in the second stage.

The second stage is one of full recovery. It is the religious stage. It gives one assurance of a fully worthwhile and meaningful life.

James's injunction is to believe—to believe in a supernatural, spiritual order of things which overcomes and makes right the deficiencies of the natural order as we know it. We do not have rational or evidential proof that such a supernatural order exists. But Kant proved that natural science cannot prove that such an order does not exist. To make one's life worthwhile and meaningful, all one has to do is to posit faith in such an order, to believe that there is a spiritual realm in which all the wrongs of the natural order are righted. In that case, one will view the natural order as an inadequate representation of the spiritual, or as a veil through which the true and wonderful nature of the spiritual is hidden or obscured.

One need have little conception of what the spiritual realm is like. The content of the belief in it can be quite minimal. All one needs to affirm is that there is such a realm and that its reality makes life worthwhile. James draws on two of the tenets of his pragmatism to support such an approach to the meaning and worthwhileness of life.  One is the right to believe what we need to believe, even though it goes beyond belief warranted by empirical and rational evidence. His classic case for the right of such belief is in his essay, "The Will to Believe."

Another tenet of pragmatism on which James draws is the idea that belief is a matter of action. To believe something is not so much to have a certain mental state as to act in a certain way. Whatever is in one's mind, to act as though life is worthwhile and has meaning is to believe that it does

In "What Makes a Life Significant" (1899), James expressly addressed the question of the significance or meaning of life. What he said in this essay was rather different from what he had said in the previous one. The essay was in part a response to the deification of the uneducated, hard-working peasants in Tolstoy's Confession. James admired Tolstoy a great deal but felt he went a bit overboard in his praise of peasant life and in his tendency to identify it as the very locus of meaning. James held that the lives of Tolstoy's peasants were full of one ingredient necessary for a meaningful life—toil, struggle, pluck, will, suffering, manly virtues—but that they lacked the other necessary ingredient for a fully meaningful life, namely, what James called "ideals."

Toward the end of the essay, James gives his own view. He states it in two or three different ways, the sense of which seems to be the same. "[I]deal visions" must be backed "with what the laborers have, the sterner stuff of manly virtue."

[T]o redeem life from insignificance, [c]ulture and refinement all alone are not enough. . . . Ideal aspirations are not enough, when uncombined with pluck and will. . . . There must be some sort of fusion, some chemical combination among these principles, for a life objectively and thoroughly significant to result. (1899: 877)

The solid meaning of life is always the same eternal thing,—the marriage, namely, of some unhabitual ideal, however special, with some fidelity, courage, and endurance; with some man's or woman's pains.—And, whatever or wherever life may be, there will always be the chance for that marriage to take place. (1899: 878)

James is rather vague about what the "ideals" are, or even what they are like. In at least some cases they have something to do with culture and refinement, but it seems that they can and will vary from person to person, and may reside in some form in the uncultured and unrefined. In any event, it is noteworthy that James does not bring up the subject of religion. There is no suggestion that belief in God or a spiritual world is necessary for a fully meaningful life. An ideal wedded to manly virtue is enough.

b. Russell

The British philosopher Bertrand Russell (1872-1970) is often portrayed as one of those early twentieth century analytic philosophers who had no patience for big questions, such as that of the meaning of life. The portrayal is often reinforced by the famous story of Russell and the cab-driver, to whom Russell had nothing to say about the meaning of life.

It is true that Russell sometimes expressed a dismissive attitude toward the question: to Hugh Moorhead he said, "Unless you assume a God, the question (of life's meaning) is meaningless" (Metz 2013b: 23), and to the taxi-driver he had indeed nothing to say about the meaning of life. But elsewhere he seems to have taken the question very seriously.

In "A Free Man's Worship," he begins with a fairly gloomy, despairing picture of the world science reveals to us, the only world there is, really. It is purposeless, void of meaning. The causes that produced us had no prevision of the end they were achieving. We ourselves, and everything precious to us, are the outcome of the accidental collocations of atoms. There is no life for the individual beyond the grave. The existence of our very species, along with all its achievements, will eventually be extinguished in the death of the solar system and "buried beneath the debris of a universe in ruins."

But the thing for us to do is to maintain our ideals against the hostile universe. That universe knows the value of raw power, and not much else. Let us not worship it, as did Nietzsche. In exalting the will to power, Nietzsche was failing to maintain the highest human ideals in the face of the cruel world; he was, in a sense, giving in, capitulating, prostrately submitting to evil, sacrificing his best to Moloch.

Let us be clear-sighted and honest. Let us recognize that the facts are often bad, that in the world we know there are many things that would have been better otherwise, that our ideals are not in fact realized in the world.

But, again, in our minds and hearts, even though the whole business may be futile, let us tenaciously cling to our ideals, loving truth and beauty. Let us renounce power. Let us worship only the God created by our own love of the good. Let us live constantly in the vision of the good.

One trap we must guard against falling into is that which (Russell would think) Camus fell into some decades later. We should not cultivate and live in a spirit of fiery revolt, of fierce hatred of the senseless universe. Why not? Because indignation is still a kind of bondage, for it compels our thoughts to be occupied with the evil world. Give up the indignation so that your thoughts can be free. From freedom of thought comes art, philosophy, and the vision of beauty.

To achieve this we must develop a kind of detachment from our own personal happiness, must learn to free ourselves from the burden of concern for petty things and personal goods.

To abandon the struggle for private happiness, to expel all eagerness of temporary desire, to burn with passion for eternal things--this is emancipation, and this is the free man's worship. (Russell 1903: 61)

In The Conquest of Happiness Russell makes a couple of remarks about the meaning of life that are worthy of note. The first is this:

The habit of looking to the future and thinking that the whole meaning of the present lies in what it will bring forth is a pernicious one. There can be no value in the whole unless there is value in the parts. Life is not to be conceived on the analogy of a melodrama in which the hero and heroine go through incredible misfortunes for which they are compensated by a happy ending. (1930: 29)

The second is odd but interesting, perhaps not the kind of thought that would occur to most people:

the human heart as modern civilisation has made it is more prone to hatred than to friendship. And it is prone to hatred because it is dissatisfied, because it feels deeply, perhaps even unconsciously, that it has somehow missed the meaning of life, that perhaps others, but not we ourselves, have secured the good things which nature offers man's enjoyment. (1930: 75)

The thought seems to be that people hate each other because they think others have achieved (or know?) the meaning of life and they don't. If that is true, one should be careful not to let on that he knows the meaning of life, even if he does.

Several writers have advocated focus and have thought of a life organized by one big project or goal as the paradigm case of a meaningful one. Russell rejects the idea.

All our affections are at the mercy of death, which may strike down those whom we love at any moment. It is therefore necessary that our lives should not have that narrow intensity which puts the whole meaning and purpose of our life at the mercy of accident. For all these reasons the man who pursues happiness wisely will aim at the possession of a number of subsidiary interests in addition to those central ones upon which his life is built. (1930: 177)

Finally, in "The Place of Science in a Liberal Education," Russell makes the now familiar point that the meaning of life must come not from without but from within.

The search for an outside meaning that can compel an inner response must always be disappointed: all "meaning" must be at bottom related to our primary desires, and when they are extinct no miracle can restore to the world the value which they reflected upon it. (Mysticism and Logic, ch. 2, "The Place of Science in a Liberal Education")

That is not to say that the meaning of life is created or chosen as opposed to discovered. For our primary desires are something largely given, something (if we are lucky) we simply find in ourselves.

c. Schlick

Moritz Schlick (1882-1936) was one of the central figures of the logical positivist movement. Thinkers in the movement are commonly said to have been dismissive of such "metaphysical" questions as that of the meaning of life. Yet Schlick for one was in no way dismissive. He described himself as a seeker of the meaning of life and wrote an extremely interesting essay on the topic in 1927.

Schlick's contribution to the debate is (to some) one of the most appealing writings in the whole of the literature. Schlick was aware of Schopenhauer's musings and was concerned to escape his dire conclusions. Schlick found his answer in (his interpretation of) Nietzsche's Thus Spake Zarathustra. The answer is that life can be meaningful only if it is freed from its subjugation to ends and purposes. The suggestion is radical: a life has meaning only if it does not have some end or purpose to which everything is subordinated.

Schlick argued that the meaning of life is to be found not in work but in play. Work, in the philosophical sense, is always something done not for its own sake but for the sake of something else, some end or purpose that is to be achieved.  Most often that end is the survival and perpetuation of life—that is, more work functioning only to perpetuate the life of the species. But it is absurd to take the meaning of life to lie in the continued survival of the species, or in the work required to make that survival possible. The meaning of life must lie in the content of existence, not in bare existence as such.

What then is the meaning of life? One candidate that suggests itself is feelings of pleasure and happiness. But Schlick rejects that candidate, partly on the grounds that pleasure is likely only to lead to the satiety and boredom which Schopenhauer so vividly made us aware of. Schlick also rejects the ideal of happiness as the meaning of life by way of the observation that man is essentially an active creature for which a life of idle pleasure is by no means suitable. What Schlick ends up saying is that the meaning of life is to be found in play, that is, in activity engaged in for its own glorious sake and not for the furtherance of some further end or goal. Doing something only in order to produce some further end or goal is work, and work cannot be the meaning of life. Of course, work is necessary for human existence and thriving, but it is meaningful only if it can—and it can be—turned into play, something one would do with delight even if nothing came of it in the end.

Schlick backs off from saying that the meaning of life is play. Instead, he says that the meaning of life is youth, since youth is the period of life in which play predominates. A nice consequence of this position is the fact that a life cut short in its infancy or youth is a meaningful life. If you are killed when you are ten years old, it is likely that you lived a life full of meaning.

One other aspect of Schlick's view should be mentioned. It is that youth is not literally a matter of how long one has lived on this earth. If an old fellow turns his work into play, if he performs it primarily for the sake of the sheer joy of doing it, then he is young in the sense that matters. The key to a fully meaningful life would be to stay forever young.

d. Tagore

The Bengali Indian poet, short-story writer, novelist, dramatist, artist, sage, and philosopher Rabindranath Tagore (1861-1941), often credited with a major role in the cross-fertilization of East and West, won the Nobel Prize in literature in 1919. He wrote in English (sometimes). He knew the works of Einstein, Yeats, Wordsworth, and a host of other Western thinkers. In 1930 he delivered the Hibbert Lectures at Oxford, published the next year as The Religion of Man (1931), a remarkable volume containing much reflection on the meaning of life. This article will limit itself to consideration of a couple of points in that book.

Tagore is interesting because his interest in the question of the meaning of life did not arise out of anything like the circumstances which seemed to create the interest in so many Western thinkers. Tagore was not well-off and bored, he did not suffer from depression and existential angst, he did not worry about the importance of his personal life in the vast scheme of things, he was not a professional academic philosopher.

Tagore's tendency was to view the question of the meaning of life as the question, "What is man?" or "What am I?" His answer seems to have been that the true human is the universal self, or the true Man represented by the life of the species, or even by the life of all beings.

If he had a problem, it lay in the chaotic, hodgepodge nature of this everyday life. Not exactly seeking for a solution to the predicament, one came to him on an ordinary day on which he was just living his everyday life in east India. He gives a gripping and poetic account of it in chapter six of The Religion of Man. He writes:

Suddenly I became conscious of a stirring of soul within me. My world of experience in a moment seemed to become lighted, and the facts that were detached and dim found a great unity of meaning. The feeling which I had was like that which a man, groping through a fog without knowing his destination, might fee when he suddenly discovers that he stands before his own house. (Tagore 1931, 95)

One thing that is noteworthy in this is that Tagore felt he had seen the meaning of life, not when he realized that his life really mattered, or added up to something sub specie aeternitatus, nor when he came up with a view of things that rid him of his angst and depression, but rather when he found that his life was part of a great unity of meaning. He saw meaning when everything, including his individual life, was one unified whole.

A second feature of Tagore's conception of the meaning of life is the role he gives to detachment. The detachment that is relevant seems to be something like non-attachment to the petty concerns of one's own individual life. It is not a lack of concern for anything and everything. It is lack of concern for how one's own individual, personal life fares. The appropriately detached person places his interest in how Man as the eternal being, or beings of any sort ultimately fare. (There is an admirable concern for all life, not just human life in the thought of Tagore.) The appropriately detached man loses concern for his personal triumphs and failures and cultivates an enlivening interest in the life of the whole, with which, instead of his personal life, he identifies himself. The result is a vast increase in the sense of meaningfulness in his own life.

e. Ayer

A very different approach to the problem of the meaning of life was taken by the prominent logical positivist English philosopher A. J. Ayer (1910-1989).

Ayer argued, in an important 1947 paper, that "there is no sense in asking what is the ultimate purpose of our existence, or what is the real meaning of life" (Ayer 1947: 201). His argument is that there is no reason to believe in anything like a God who created us and intended us for a specific purpose. And even if there were such a God, his purposes could not give life meaning unless we agreed with them and accepted them. Thus the meaning of life always comes back to what we as individuals purpose, value, and aim at. There is no meaning out there to be discovered.

Ayer insists that the meaninglessness of life is nothing to cry about. One's life has whatever meaning one gives it. It just doesn't make sense to ask about the meaning of life because there is not, and could not be, such a thing. The question "What is the meaning of life?" is illogical and unanswerable. But a person can give his life a meaning, and if he does, it will be meaningful to him. It will come down to the value judgments the person makes. And these are a matter of personal choice and preference. There is no sense in saying that one person's value judgments are true and another's false. Give your life a meaning, and that's the meaning it will have.

5. Conclusion

The dismissal of the question about the meaning of life which was characteristic of Ayer and his generation, and Camus's idea that meaninglessness doesn't matter, may be what ironically sparked the recent interest in the question. The natural philosophical response is that surely the question of the meaning of life is meaningful and important: in light of the remarks of Ayer, Camus, and their ilk, how is that so? A sense that the meaning of life must be a philosophical problem that matters has motivated work on the question of what the question of the meaning of life is all about, if we do not take Ayer's dismissive attitude and Camus's stance toward it. The work of Richard Taylor, Robert Nozick, Thomas Nagel, Joel Feinberg, Harry Frankfurt, Susan Wolf, Thaddeus Metz, Joshua Seachris, Julian Young, John Cottingham, David Benatar, and Garrett Thomson (among others) are attempts to answer this question.

The preceding survey brings us up to around 1950, just before a veritable explosion of works on the meaning of life took place in philosophy, especially in the Anglo-analytic tradition. Those interested in this explosion should begin by consulting the excellent overviews in Thaddeus Metz's article in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Metz 2013) and Joshua Seachris's article in The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Seachris 2012)

6. References and Further Reading

  • Ayer, A. J. “The Claims of Philosophy.” Reprinted in The Meaning of Life, 3rd Ed.. E. D. Klemke (ed.). New York: Oxford University Press, 2008: 199-202. (Originally published in 1947)
  • Baier, K. "The Meaning of Life." Reprinted in The Meaning of Life. E. D. Klemke (ed.). New York: Oxford University Press, 1981: 81-117. (Originally published in 1947.)
  • Camus, A. "The Myth of Sisyphus." J. O'Brien (tr.). Reprinted in part in Ways of Wisdom: Readings on the Good Life, Steve Smith (ed.). Lanham, MD: University Press of America, 1983: 244-255. (Originally published in French in 1943.)
  • Carlyle, T. 1834. Fraser's Magazine. available online at Project Gutenberg.
  • Heidegger, M. Being and Time. J. Macquarrie and J. Robinson (trs.). Oxford: Blackwell, 1973. (Originally published in German in 1927.)
  • James, W. "Is Life Worth Living?.” in The Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy, New York: Dover Publications, 1956: 32-62. (Originally published in 1895.)
  • James, W. “What Makes a Life Significant?.” in On Some of Life's Ideals. New York: Henry Holt and Company, 1899: 49–94. Reprinted in William James: Writings 1878-1899. New York: The Library of America, 1992: 861-80.
  • Kierkegaard, S. Concluding Unscientific Postscript. (Available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally published in Danish in 1846.)
  • Kierkegaard, S. Either/Or: A Fragment of Life. (Available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally published in Danish in 1843.)
  • Klemke, E. D. (ed.). The Meaning of Life. New York: Oxford University Press, 1981.
  • Klemke, E. D. (ed.). The Meaning of Life. 2nd Ed. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Klemke, E. D. & Cahn, S. (eds.). The Meaning of Life: A Reader, 3rd Ed. New York: Oxford University Press, 2008.
  • Metz, T. "The Meaning of Life.” The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2013 Edition). Edward N. Zalta (ed.).
  • Nagel, T. "The Absurd," Reprinted in The Meaning of Life. E. D. Klemke (ed.). New York: Oxford University Press, 1981: 151-161. (Originally published in 1971.)
  • Nietzsche, F. Ecce Homo. (available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally written in German in 1888-1889.)
  • Nietzsche, F. On the Genealogy of Morals. Ian Johnston (tr.). 2009.
  • Nietzsche, F. Thus Spake Zarathustra. (available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally written in German in 1883-1885.)
  • Nietzsche, F. Twilight of the Idols. (available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally written in German in 1888-1899.)
  • Nietzsche, F. The Will to Power. (available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally published in German in 1901-1911.)
  • The Oxford English Dictionary. Oxford: Oxford University Press: 2014.
  • Russell, B. "A Free Man's Worship.” Reprinted in The Meaning of Life. E. D. Klemke (ed.). New York: Oxford University Press, 1981: 55-62. (Originally published in 1903.)
  • Russell, B. The Conquest of Happiness. London: Liveright, 1930.
  • Sartre, J. P. Being and Nothingness. H. E. Barnes (tr.). New York: Philosophical Library, 1956. (Originally published in French in 1943.)
  • Sartre, J. P. "Existentialism and Humanism." B. Frechtman (tr.). 1956. Reprinted in Ways of Wisdom. S. Smith (ed.). Lanham, MD: University Press of America, 1983: 234-43.
  • Schlick, M. 1927. "On the Meaning of Life.” Reprinted in The Meaning of Life: A Reader, 3rd Ed., E. D. Klemke & S. Cahn (eds.). P. Heath (tr.). New York: Oxford University Press, 2008: 62-71. (Originally published in 1927.)
  • Schopenhauer, A. 1840. On the Basis of Morality. (available free online and in several editions)
  • Schopenhauer, A. "On the Suffering of the World.” in Essays and Aphorisms. R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). New York: Penguin Books, 1970: 41-50. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
  • Schopenhauer, A. "On the Vanity of Existence.” in Essays and Aphorisms. R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). New York: Penguin Books, 1970: 51-54. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
  • Schopenhauer, A. "On Affirmation and Denial of the Will to Live.” in Essays and Aphorism., R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). New York: Penguin Books, 1970: 61-65. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
  • Schopenhauer, A. "On Suicide.” in Essays and Aphorisms. R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). New York: Penguin Books, 1970: 77-79. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
  • Schopenhauer, A. The Essays of Arthur Schopenhauer: The Wisdom of Life. T. B. Saunders (tr.). 1860. rpr. in The Project Gutenberg EBook of The Essays of Arthur Schopenhauer, 2004.
  • Schopenhauer, A. The Essays of Arthur Schopenhauer: On Human Nature. T. B. Saunders (tr.). 1860. Reprinted in The Project Gutenberg EBook of The Essays of Arthur Schopenhauer, 2004,
  • Schopenhauer, A. The World as Will and Representation. 2 Vols. E. F. J. Payne (tr.). 1969. New York: Dover Publications. (Vol. 1 first appeared in 1818, Vol. 2 in 1844, in German.)
  • Schopenhauer, A. Essays and Aphorisms, R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). 1970. New York: Penguin Books. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
  • Seachris, J., 2012, "Meaning of Life: The Analytic Perspective,” The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy,
  • Smith, S., (ed.), 1983, Ways of Wisdom: Readings on the Good Life, Lanham, MD: University Press of America.
  • Tagore, R., 1961, The Religion of Man, London: George Allen & Unwin Co., Reprinted Boston: Beacon Press. (Originally published in 1930.)
  • Taylor, R., 1970, "The Meaning of Life," Reprinted in The Meaning of Life, E. D. Klemke (ed.), New York: Oxford University Press, 1981: 141-150.
  • Tolstoy, L., 2005, A Confession, Aylmer Maude (tr.), Reprinted Mineola, NY: Dover Publications. (Originally published in 1884.)
  • Young, J. 2014, The Death of God and the Meaning of Life, 2nd ed., New York & London: Routledge.


Author Information

Wendell O'Brien
Morehead State University
U. S. A.

American Wilderness Philosophy

Roosevelt & Muir, by Underwood & Underwood Wilderness has been defined in diverse ways, but most famously in the Wilderness Act of 1964, which describes it “in contrast with those areas where man and his own works dominate the landscape … as an area where the earth and its community of life are untrammeled by man, where man himself is a visitor who does not remain.” The idea of wilderness has played a curious and crucial role in American culture generally, and especially in the rise of American environmentalism. Conquering wilderness was central to colonial and pioneer narratives of progress. Reverence and nostalgia for wilderness became tangled with American nationalism at the end of the 19th century, with the end of the frontier. The passage of the Wilderness Act was an historically important event in American environmental politics, which tied the fate of much of America’s public lands to disputes over the meaning of wilderness. Since then, critics both international and domestic, but mostly from within the environmental movement, have criticized the idea of wilderness. Not that preserving or protecting natural places is a bad idea, rather they argue that thinking about nature in terms of wilderness obscures important issues and leads to bad decisions.

Table of Contents

  1. Etymology
  2. Historical Attitudes
    1. Sources of Antipathy
    2. Sources of Appreciation
  3. Wilderness Preservation: Major Figures
    1. Henry David Thoreau
    2. John Muir
    3. Aldo Leopold
  4. The Wilderness Act
  5. Critical Scholarship
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Etymology

The etymology, or history of a word, is sometimes offered as though the roots revealed the word’s correct, present meaning. This is a misunderstanding, as the meaning of a word changes over time and may end up far from its original use. However, an etymology may provide important clues into the biography of an idea and may have rhetorical significance when the meaning of a word is contested. Both of these are true of the etymology of wilderness.  A rough summary of the roots of wilderness is a place essentially characterized by wild animals.  The oldest and central root in this word is wild. It is present in Common Germanic, and is found in Old English as wilde, with surviving instances from c.725 as an adjective for plants and animals that were not tamed or domesticated and applied similarly to places by c.893. The Oxford English Dictionary gives its probable origin as the pre-Germanic ghweltijos, with a possible parallel in the root of the Latin and Greek words for wild beast.

An alternate and apparently mistaken origin of wild often given in the wilderness literature, repeated in Thoreau’s journals and given by Roderick Nash for instance, is that it is the past participle of will (Nash 2014). Wilderness is understood to be self-willed land, not subjected to the will of a domesticator or cultivator. The resonance of the idea is strong, but unfortunately the Old English willian, the root of will, has no clear connection to wilde. One upshot of rejecting this interpretation is that wild is first a word for plants and animals, later applied by analogy to people, and not vice versa as Nash reports.

The next piece in the etymology is the Common Germanic word for beast, found in Old English as deor. This was combined with wilde to form wilddeor, “wild animal,” with instances known from c.825. The “(d)er” which separates wilderness from wildness, is the root of our modern word for deer. In Old English, this was combined with the suffix –en, to make the adjective wilddeoren, which became wildern in Middle English, and was used to describe places. The –en suffix generally denotes what something is made of, as in “wooden” and “earthen,” so a wildern place is one made of wilddeor, of wild beasts. To this is joined the suffix –ness in an unusually concrete sense to form wilderness..

The centrality of wild animals in the etymology is important. Wilderness points not only to the absence of human culture in the landscape but to the presence of that which is often incompatible with it. When the wolves and the bears flourish, the domestic livestock are in danger, and people fear to walk at night. And wild beasts are easily displaced by human activity and presence. Aldo Leopold calls the crane “wildness incarnate” because of its love of solitude (1949). Nash draws out this connection to animals when he interprets the etymology as “the place of wild beasts” (1970). “If wildlife is removed,” he writes, “although everything else remains visibly the same, the intensity of the sense of wilderness is diminished” (Nash 1970). He cites Thoreau’s delight in the New England Lynx, Theodore Roosevelt’s equating wilderness with big game ranges and Leopold’s discussion of the last Grizzly on Escudilla. Leopold often treats particular species as defining the character of the places they dwell.

2. Historical Attitudes

A history of conflicted attitudes towards wild places and nonhuman nature goes much further back than the roots of the word wilderness. Many languages have no equivalent word to wilderness, but still they have managed sophisticated literature on the question. Both the beauty and the inhospitality of wild nature, and humanity’s ambiguous relationship to it, are common themes going back to the very oldest preserved literature.

In telling the history of attitudes toward wild nature, there are two opposite errors of oversimplification to avoid. On the one hand, some treat the modern American and romantic elevation of wilderness as something entirely new, contrasting with previous expressions of antipathy toward wild nature. Roderick Nash (2014) leans in this direction when he says wilderness began “as the unrecognized and unnamed environmental norm for most of Earth’s history, created as a concept by civilization, thereafter widely hated and feared, and quite recently and remarkably, appreciated.” On the other hand, one might find romantic sounding passages of wilderness appreciation in diverse ancient texts, whether the Epic of Gilgamesh, the Vedas or the Psalms, and conclude that there is nothing particularly new or interesting about the American idea. The more interesting historical questions are the more nuanced considerations concerning how and why wilderness is valued or shunned across times and cultures.

a. Sources of Antipathy

While there was no universal hatred or fear of wild nature in the ancient world, at least not to the exclusion of a great deal of appreciation, there was a remarkable degree of denigration of wild nature, reaching something of a climax in early modern Europe. Romanticism was in part a reaction against this, and the ideas that lead to it, and modern wilderness appreciation and preservation took root in the soil of romanticism. The origins of that hostility are variously attributed to the Jewish and Christian scriptures, Greek and Roman philosophy, the scientific and industrial revolutions, or some combination of these.

Clear claims of anthropocentrism, of the relative worthlessness and proper subjugation of wild nature, are frequently found in ancient Greek and Roman philosophers. Here, rationality is established both as the substance of dignity and worth and as the dividing line between the human and the nonhuman (as well as marking the proper hierarchies between some humans and others). Plato, in the voice of Socrates, makes clear his limited estimation of the value of wild things in the Phaedrus (section 230d) when he writes, “I am devoted to learning; landscapes and trees have nothing to teach me—only the people in the city can do that.” Aristotle shows a much greater inclination to appreciate and study wild nature, but he makes clear its subjugation and secondary value: nature making nothing in vain means that it all must exist for the sake of man (Politics 1256b7-22). Chrysippus agrees, finding it absurd to think that the world could have been made for the plants, or the irrational animals (cited in Coates 1998). The Roman philosopher Lucretius describes the presence of forests, mountains and wild beasts on the earth as a serious defect, taking heart that “these regions it is generally in our power to shun” (cited in Nash 2014). This is not to say that there were no elements of appreciation for wild nature in Greek or Roman society or letters, for that is not the case. But there was a clearly articulated and enduring view which implied wild nature was essentially wasted space.

Many commentators, including Nash, have followed Lynn White’s lead in pointing to theism and the Jewish and Christian scriptures as the source of antipathy toward wild nature (White 1967). These scriptures had a formative influence on modern attitudes toward wilderness because of the prominent use of the word in English translations of the Bible. Spiritual connotations, especially from the Exodus account of the Israelites wandering in the wilderness for forty years, were laid onto the word, as well as new physical associations with arid and desert landscapes. The meaning of these spiritual connotations is complex, as wilderness is at once a place of divine revelation as well as temptation and punishment. The Bible does not clearly convey an overarching attitude of fear or hatred of the wild. Genesis 1 repeatedly declares the goodness of everything, prior to the creation of humans. The Psalms celebrate both the useless parts of nature, such as rock badgers, as well as the dangerous, such as lions, as independently glorifying to God (Psalm 104).  Animals, both wild and domestic, plants and even soil are given protections in the Mosaic Law (for example, Exodus 23:10-11; Deuteronomy 20:19-20, 22:6, 25:4), and God is described as making covenant with the Earth and all its creatures (Genesis 9). Even the often cited passage giving people dominion over the other animals, does not clearly put them at human disposal, for it manifestly did not include permission to eat animals (Genesis 1:28-29; Genesis 9:3).

As Greco-Roman philosophy and Christian theology increasingly joined together in medieval and modern European intellectual culture, the ideas of Plato and Aristotle were given new expression in biblical and theological language. Rationality is privileged by Aquinas in this combined way, for instance, arguing that only the rational creatures can know and love God and thereby fulfill the purpose of creation (Summa Contra Gentiles c.1270).  The enlightenment and scientific revolution included a great revival of interest in Greek and Roman philosophy, and serious interest in nature was focused onto the search for universal, mathematical laws. Francis Bacon’s writings in the early 17th century established a lasting connection between the idea of dominion in Genesis and the project of scientific-technological mastery over nature. The metaphor of nature as machine came to dominate. Descartes argued that, lacking rationality, non-human animals should not be supposed to have souls or consciousness at all, but are mere automata, to be freely experimented upon (Discourse on Method 1637). As the scientific project bore fruit in the industrial revolution, the dominant view of wild nature was as disordered material which could be brought into rational order through science and labor, and thus serve its ultimate purpose of existing for the benefit of mankind. This view is clearly expressed in John Locke’s influential labor-theory of property, which justifies the human worker’s property rights over nature on the basis of nature having little to no value before the worker’s labor was mixed with it (Second Treatise on Government 1689).

The Lockean attitude toward wilderness as waste is clearly evident among the early American colonists. For instance, the Puritan John Winthrop gave as a reason for going to America that it would be wrong to let a whole continent lie waste (Nash 2014). Justification for displacing indigenous people was often asserted on the basis that they had not worked it, or at least not rationally. And the attitude continued to dominate well into the settlement of the west. Alexis de Tocqueville complained upon visiting America in the 1830s that Americans could only see their wilderness as an obstacle to progress (cited in Nash 2014). During the time of the exploration, colonization and settlement of the North America by the Europeans, the idea that the less rational parts of nature existed for the sake of the more rational was thoroughly entrenched. And wilderness especially had to be transformed by labor to fulfill that purpose.

b. Sources of Appreciation

The scientific revolution also produced a contrary attitude towards nonhuman nature, however, best expressed in a group known as the physic-theologians. Writers such as John Ray (1627-1705) found in wild nature, not the absence of rationality, but the rational design of God, worthy of study and contemplation. Indeed, studying wild nature was thought to be an especially important path to understanding God, since only wild nature was unaffected by the fall and sin of mankind. Physico-theology contributed to the rise and influence of natural history, an approach to science that in turn deeply informed the wilderness preservation movement.

The practice of natural history flourished in America in the 18th and 19th centuries and was characterized by the description, collection and classification of natural specimens and objects. The fondness of European aristocrats and intellectuals for natural curiosities from around the world made natural history a singular way for colonists to stay connected to the social and intellectual affairs of Europe. The travel and work of natural historians was thus often tangled with the broader European projects of exploration and conquest, and the naturalists, who frequently found themselves caring for what was being destroyed, often expressed significant concern about this connection. Natural historians were largely generalists, writing about nature as a comprehensive whole, and often organized in local, amateur, natural history societies (Smallwood 1967). Some like Alexander von Humboldt, were well connected members of European society who travelled over much of the world, while others like John and William Bartram and John James Audubon were from the colonies and travelled only regionally. Artistic and literary abilities were crucial for their success, and the travel narratives of naturalists became a popular literary genre, where some of the earliest and strongest positive evaluations of wild nature found their greatest audiences.

Romanticism, a multifaceted cultural trend and backlash against the scientific and industrial revolutions, brought not just an acceptance but an enthusiastic veneration of wild nature and wilderness to cultural prominence. Romanticism had strong connections to the natural history tradition: William Wordsworth and Samuel Coleridge were readers of William Bartram (Smallwood 1967), and Alexander von Humboldt was closely associated with Goethe. But romanticism’s influence on wilderness appreciation comprised much more than its further endorsement of natural history as a significant mode of science. Romanticism treated aesthetic responses to nature as just as important as nature’s quantifiable properties, and developed a robust conception of the sublime. Romantic trends in literature and painting, especially the Hudson River school, produced many powerful, positive portrayals of wilderness. Suspecting that modern industrial society corrupts people rather than cultivates them, romanticism also endorsed primitivism and the pursuit of frequent solitude in nature.

Another aspect of romanticism that was important for the rise of wilderness preservation, was its emphasis on nationalism. America’s great wilderness became a point of pride and national identity, something that set it apart from Europe. The historian Frederick Jackson Turner argued that several aspects of the American character, from self-reliance to a democratic spirit, were products of the American frontier experience (1921). And he worried that the continuation of the American national distinctiveness was jeopardized by the end of the frontier, which was formally declared in the 1890 census. Frontier nostalgia drove a lot of early preservation work, as well as related phenomena, particularly the scouting movement and recreational hunting.

America also saw the development of a distinctive form of the romantic movement known as American transcendentalism. Ralph Waldo Emerson’s Nature, a seminal text for transcendentalism, explores the importance of solitude, the beauty of nature and the significance for both of these for understanding God. Emerson’s influence on Henry David Thoreau, and his long relationship with him, plants the roots of the American wilderness preservation movement firmly in transcendentalism. For Thoreau is the first major figure and intellectual of the wilderness tradition.

Another important factor in in the growing appreciation of wilderness was America’s early experience with extensive deforestation. Among the many who bemoaned this loss, none articulated the problem for the public more clearly and effectively than George Perkins Marsh. His 1864 Man and Nature first clearly indicted deforestation for its effects on soil and water. Marsh refuted the naïve optimism of the day, concerning the beneficial effects of all human labor on nature, and outlined rather the devastating, unintended harms caused by inappropriate uses of land. The economically practical case he provided for the conservation of forests and general care for the land provided an important complement to the aesthetic and spiritual emphasis of the romantics.

3. Wilderness Preservation: Major Figures

Expressions of wilderness appreciation multiplied quickly in the late 19th and early 20th century, and many people made distinctive contributions in art, literature, science and policy. A few major figures, however, laid out distinctive visions which guided the course of wilderness preservation, and which contemporary scholars tend to treat as the defining core of the tradition.

a. Henry David Thoreau

Thoreau’s work develops many of the romantic themes towards nature. Especially in Walden, he is concerned with the degrading influence of too much society, commerce and industry and with the salutary effects of nature’s company. He was a frequent canoe traveler and mountaineer, and developed a daily habit of extensive hiking. Both Walden and his travel writings argue for the existence of deeper meanings and higher uses in nature than as mere material for the human economy. He found the aesthetic value of nature to be spiritually and morally important, and woefully underappreciated. But he also spoke of a broader point view, which sees the weeds as food for the birds and the squirrels as planters of the forest. Recognizing that nature, often in the very places it is widely despised, has hidden and indirect values, he anticipates the contemporary economic idea of ecosystem services.

After his stay at Walden Pond, Thoreau turned his energies increasingly to natural history, particularly in the mode of Humboldt. He expressed some concern about the possibility of a purely scientific disenchanting nature and dulling of the imagination. But he was committed to cultivating the greatest awareness of nature as possible and to fully appreciating the value of facts, refusing to reduce appearances to the merely symbolic as Emerson had tended to. He kept careful records of plant and animal distribution and phenology, which have proven valuable for current climate science, and made seminal contributions to the understanding of forest succession and seed distribution. Unfortunately Thoreau’s early death left many of these projects unfinished and unpublished, although most are now available. His extensive journals, influential works in their own right, show a rich blending of this careful attention to natural history with the poetic and philosophical insight.

The essay Walking, revised and reworked until the end of his life, is particularly significant for wilderness thought. In this essay he treats wildness as the highest ideal of ethics and aesthetics and defends the view that both land and people need a balance of the cultivated and the wild, albeit sharply tilted toward the wild. In this work appears his oft-quoted dictum that “In wildness is the preservation of the world.” Max Oelschlaeger points to Thoreau’s lament for pine trees reduced to mere lumber as the earliest and clearest statement of a preservationist’s credo: “Every creature is better alive than dead, men and moose and pine trees, and he who understands it aright will rather preserve its life than destroy it” (cited in Oelschlaeger 1991). Other late works, such as Huckleberries, progress from his early radical valuations of nature to clear preservationist policy arguments for parks, greenways and protected areas.

Considered a minor figure at first, then highly esteemed in American literature and political thought, Thoreau’s philosophical contributions—not only to environmental philosophy but also epistemology, philosophy of science and ethics—received increasing attention in the early 21st century.

b. John Muir

The Muir family emigrated from Scotland when Muir was a young boy, as his father sought the opportunity to live his Campbellite faith more authentically. Muir’s childhood was saturated with an evangelical Biblicism and the poetry of Robert Burns, the Scottish romantic. His experience as a frontier farmer was largely negative, as he was sorely abused by his father for hard labor. Thanks in part to his genius for mechanics and invention, he found his way to the University of Wisconsin in Madison where he found an enthusiasm for botany. He also encountered transcendentalism and a romantic, nature-centered spirituality, which at first supplemented and then gradually transformed his evangelical faith. There is substantial debate on if and when he might be considered a pantheist. What is clear is that Muir’s wilderness philosophy is often expressed in much more intensely religious language than Thoreau’s, and is frequently wrapped in biblical metaphor.

Frequently a solitary traveler in the wilderness himself, he often focused on the potential of wilderness and of nature study for personal and spiritual transformation. His prescription for overworked and materialistic America was a conversion, a baptism in mountain beauty and reconciliation to wild nature. Muir found nature to be not only sublime and beautiful but earnestly benevolent. Even what appears harsh and destructive in nature, such as glaciation (a process on which he became a significant expert), should be seen as part of the ongoing, loving, creative process. Like Thoreau, Muir found tame and domestic plants and animals to be generally degraded versions of their wild counterparts, and he sometimes spoke in terms of the rights of nonhuman nature.

Muir’s increasing political significance grew out of his personal involvement with Yosemite, and its gradual progress toward becoming a national park. He became convinced that federal ownership was the only way that such exceptional places could be preserved from destruction. While God had preserved California’s giant trees through the ages, he wrote, only Uncle Sam could protect them from fools (1901). His eloquent writing on behalf of national parks and preservation made him a figurehead for the movement, a role which was formalized with the formation of the Sierra Club with him as charter president.

Early in the 20th century, the movement for conservation on public lands began to fracture. Muir came to represent one end of a spectrum on how much and what sort of economic uses should be present in the federal reserves. Muir’s emphasis on the spiritual and aesthetic values of wilderness clashed with the progressive, utilitarian vision of Gifford Pinchot, who was more concerned that the nation’s resources should be developed efficiently for the public good, protected from shortsighted exploitation for private enrichment. The proposed and eventual damming of Hetch Hetchy Valley, within Yosemite National Park, for municipal water and power, brought this tension to bitter conflict during Muir’s later years. Muir was not opposed to productive work in nature, nor the human transformation of it in many places. He spent many profitable years working in sawmills and later managing a vineyard. But beauty, he held, is as much a need as bread or water is, and our physical needs can be met without destroying our most beautiful scenery. Just as timber can be had without cutting the redwoods, water could be had without flooding a national park. Muir saw the problem as one of greed for profit unconstrained by higher sensibilities.

c. Aldo Leopold

Aldo Leopold made significant contributions to both wilderness philosophy and policy. An avid naturalist and outdoorsman, Leopold worked within the new forest service to enhance recreation and hunting opportunities. He developed and established the scientific practice of game management. He was constant in his advocacy of a thoughtful and informed stewardship of nature, but his early confidence in the possibility and value of scientific manipulation the land for increased timber and game production was heavily tempered in his mature work.

Leopold’s major policy contribution was to push for a separate classification of land within the national forests, to be kept as roadless wilderness—a clear precursor to the Wilderness Act. Leopold, and those who followed his lead, such as Bob Marshall and the other founders of the Wilderness Society, were responding to the rise of the automobile, which Muir had not so much appreciated as a threat to wilderness. Touring and camping by automobile was growing rapidly, and the parks and forest recreation areas were filling with the roads and hotels to accommodate them. Leopold sought to protect some areas from this sort of development, first for those who wished to pursue more primitive types of recreation, including travel by canoe and pack train, and seekers of solitude, and then later for the protection of land and wildlife.

Philosophically, Leopold integrated wilderness appreciation with the maturing science of ecology, developed new arguments for preserving wilderness and articulated a moral vision for human relations to nonhuman nature, which he called the land ethic. From ecology, Leopold took a much more detailed picture of the land as an interdependent system of plants, animals, soils and natural processes—a biotic community. Understanding the land as a functionally integrated entity means that the land can be healthy or sick, analogously to an organism. Nutrients can be retained in cycles or lost; soils can be accumulated or depleted; species can persist or become extinct. Only healthy land has the capacity to replenish itself when disturbed. And since the workings of the land mechanism are beyond a full human understanding, an attitude of caution is warranted. Removing predators (the standard practice when he began his forestry career) could lead to disastrous consequences for soils and plants, a lesson he learned from personal experience.

Leopold developed the recreation argument for wilderness along several lines. Against charges of elitism, that big wilderness served the small minority with the strength and leisure time for it, he held that minority interests are worthy of protection. There is no danger of insufficient places for the more popular auto tourism, and public lands should not all be devoted to one kind of recreation. Camping and woodcraft are not only an idle nostalgia for our frontier past, they are a moral improvement upon it, directing old instincts to higher ends. He likened this change to the way football is an improvement over war; the transformation to sport preserved the best parts of the older practice without the downsides.

In later works, Leopold increasingly emphasized the value of wilderness for science. Wilderness is not the only healthy land, some traditional agricultural landscapes have showed long-term resilience, but it provides crucial examples of biotic communities that have functioned well over long time spans. Ecologists need wilderness the way doctors need healthy bodies to study. His own restoration of a worn-out farm demonstrated the practical value of this kind of ecological knowledge. Wilderness is also an important refuge for preserving wildlife, especially the large predators generally eliminated in other places. The arguments from science and wildlife are not entirely separate from the recreation argument, as Leopold suggests that wildlife study is one of the greatest forms of outdoor recreation.

The land ethic grew out of Leopold’s conviction that only a change in our ethical attitude toward the land could prevent us from spoiling it. Such a change he thought was not only possible but underway. The care people naturally feel toward their community and their neighbor can be extended to the land, for ecology clearly shows that the land is a community to which we belong. The recognition that we are plain members and citizens of that community supports the restraint and forbearance that is necessary to live in harmony with the land. Preserving the “integrity, stability and beauty of the biotic community” should limit our use of the land, as surely as economic feasibility does.

Leopold’s land ethic has been heralded as the first ecocentric ethic, an approach finally adequate to our environmental problems. It has also been criticized as offering a fascist justification for overriding individual rights in the interest of the community (Tom Regan, cited in Callicott 1987). Its lineage has also been debated: whether it is based on Darwin’s use of Hume’s ethics (Callicott 1987), or if it has more in common with the pragmatism Leopold would have encountered at Yale (Norton 1988). Either way, Leopold’s respect for the biotic community and his vision of wilderness as an important use within federal lands profoundly shaped the future of environmental thought and the coming Wilderness Act.

4. The Wilderness Act

The National Wilderness Preservation System was created with the passage of the Wilderness Act in 1964. The Act did not create a separate agency, but designated and protected roadless areas within federal lands, whether managed by the Forest Service, National Park Service, Fish and Wildlife Service or the Bureau of Land Management. The Act provides for substantial public input on proposed listings and requires congressional action for land to be added or removed from the system. Similar to national parks, wilderness areas are required to be managed under a twin mandate, kept both for the “use and enjoyment” of the people and preserving their wilderness character unimpaired.

The Wilderness Act includes a poetic definition of wilderness, which has been the subject of much critical discussion:

A wilderness, in contrast with those areas where man and his own works dominate the landscape, is hereby recognized as an area where the earth and its community of life are untrammeled by man, where man himself is a visitor who does not remain. An area of wilderness is further defined to mean in this Act an area of undeveloped Federal land retaining its primeval character and influence, without permanent improvements or human habitation, which is protected and managed so as to preserve its natural conditions and which (1) generally appears to have been affected primarily by the forces of nature, with the imprint of man's work substantially unnoticeable; (2) has outstanding opportunities for solitude or a primitive and unconfined type of recreation; (3) has at least five thousand acres of land or is of sufficient size as to make practicable its preservation and use in an unimpaired condition; and (4) may also contain ecological, geological, or other features of scientific, educational, scenic, or historical value.

Some of the definition’s notable features are the emphasis on the absence of human presence and impact, the language of degree and subjective appearance and the unusual word, “untrammeled.” Trammel is not a form of trample, and does not involve the idea of walking. It means to bind up, constrain or fetter, not simply touch or influence. Trammel can also be a noun, referring to a kind of fish net or to rope shackles tied on a horse’s legs to keep it from galloping.

Implementation of the Wilderness Act required some interpretive decisions. The Forest Service, generally seeking to maintain more flexible control over its lands, argued for a strict interpretation of wilderness, excluding any lands with a significant history of human impact. This came to be known as the purity policy. Others, including the Wilderness Society, the non-profit organization which had first pushed for the law and shepherded it through the years of debate before it finally passed, argued for a more flexible and pragmatic understanding of wilderness (Turner 2012). Rather than looking back at whether the land had suffered human impact, the question was whether it could be managed in a way that would render human impact substantially unnoticeable in the future (Woods 1998).

At stake in this question was both how big the wilderness system could be and whether there would be more than a few wilderness areas east of the Mississippi, where historic impacts were generally greater. The forward-looking approach championed by the Wilderness Society eventually triumphed with the 1975 designation of many eastern areas with significant past impacts, which has come to be called the Eastern Wilderness Act.

Another issue that came into the question of purity was how much wilderness should be protected from recreational overuse. Frontier nostalgia tended to a form of recreational woodcraft that was fairly high impact, with campers cutting boughs for beds and lean-tos, for instance. As outdoor recreation continued to increase in popularity through the 1960s and 70s, there was debate over whether wilderness and lands for recreation ought to be given separate designations, which would have resulted in far less wilderness areas. The dilemma was mitigated with a movement toward low-impact camping, culminating in the Leave No Trace program (Turner 2002). While vastly increasing the number of people who can camp in a wilderness area without spoiling it, the new methods have also introduced a greater dependence on consumer products and synthetic materials and reduced the need for knowledge of the natural history of the place.

Another test for the meaning of federal wilderness areas would come with the debates over public lands in Alaska, where vast roadless areas often contained indigenous peoples practicing subsistence lifestyles. In 1980, the Alaska National Interest Lands Conservation Act added 56 million acres to the National Wilderness Preservation System, more than doubling its size, but permitting many activities crucial to subsistence living not permitted in designated wilderness outside Alaska. Some motorized access and even log cabins, it was decided, do not pose the same threat to the “Earth and its community of life” in Alaska as they would in the more densely populated U.S. states.

5. Critical Scholarship

Wilderness preservation has often faced criticism and opposition in the political arena. The Sagebrush Rebellion was largely a reaction against the implementation of the Wilderness Act on western lands. Such conflict is often rooted in issues of public versus private property rights. The academic literature on wilderness has tended to focus on other issues—the history of the idea, its influence on policy, and whether it represents a reasonable or appropriate approach to nonhuman nature.

Roderick Nash’s 1967 book, Wilderness and the American Mind, was the seminal work for contemporary wilderness scholarship. It traced the history of the idea of wilderness from ancient attitudes toward nature through the passage of the Wilderness Act. Nash frames the story as the remarkable rise of appreciation for wilderness from the midst of long-standing antipathy. Though not without offering some criticism, the work is largely celebratory of the wilderness tradition and preservation movement and has had an enduring popularity with the backpackers and activists as well as a lasting influence on scholarship. Much of the wilderness scholarship subsequent to Nash’s work has essentially aimed to supplement or correct the general picture given in it.

The first in a series of criticisms and responses, that came to be known as the great new wilderness debate, came from Ramachandra Guha, an environmental and political historian from India (1989). Guha argued that the radical environmental movement in America had an unhealthy focus on biocentrism and wilderness, which are largely irrelevant to the problems he claims are at the root of the environmental crisis: overconsumption and militarization. Environmentalism in India has largely been a class struggle between the rural poor, who depend on the forests for their subsistence, and the over-consuming urban industrialists, which threaten to destroy the forests and poor alike. Western environmental organizations coming into India and working to establish wilderness-like reserves, such as the tiger reserves, are further displacing traditional subsistence economies to make playgrounds for the wealthy. Wilderness, according to Guha, was not appropriate in densely and long inhabited places like India.

William Cronon, an environmental historian, and J. Baird Callicott, an environmental philosopher, followed with arguments that there was something more deeply flawed about the idea of wilderness, even in North America (Cronon 1995; Callicott 1991). Unlike Guha, both insisted that they support protected areas; their problem was with a way of thinking. Wilderness is historically false, denying the long and extensive human influences on the North American landscape, and thus continuing the denial of the humanity of Native Americans. Wilderness thinking presupposes a pre-Darwinian dichotomy between people and nature by treating only people-less places as real or pristine nature. The result of this dualism is misanthropy and a tendency to see the removal of people as the solution to every environmental problem. Holding wilderness to be the ideal form of nature, they argued, is an obstacle to a responsible environmentalism, which must help us live in harmony with nature in the places we inhabit and work not just the places we visit and play in. Cronon in particular worried that caring for pristine nature far from home makes it easier to tolerate the abuse and destruction of mundane nature close to home. Wilderness thinking, they alleged, also tends to treat nature as static, seeking to preserve a place in a particular form, instead of recognizing the dynamic processes at play in nature.

More critics soon followed, drawing out the imperialism, colonialism or ethnocentrism latent in the preservation project. Many of the criticisms were clearly grounded. Frontier nostalgia requires a certain blindness to the perspectives of Native Americans, and western style parks have been implemented in Africa in ways that are brutal to the indigenous inhabitants. But many wilderness advocates found the criticisms to be unfair overall and not helpful to achieving the responsible environmentalism the critics claimed to desire. The Wilderness Act had not endorsed an ideal of pristine or untouched nature, and the Forest Service’s attempt to interpret it that way had been roundly defeated (Friskics 2008). And the experience in Alaska had showed that wilderness preservation need not be hostile to indigenous people or traditional subsistence cultures. It is not that the environmental movement in America has only sought wilderness preservation and not worked for reform in forestry, agriculture and industry; it is just that reform efforts have often been less successful and harder to accomplish than wilderness designation (Foreman 1998).

Val Plumwood gives a thorough analysis of the issue of dualism in the wilderness tradition, finding it in the frequent appellation, “virgin,” and the legal doctrine of terra nullius in the Australian outback (1998). But she also demonstrated how much of the tradition is open to a non-dualistic interpretation, treating the other of wilderness not as the mere absence of the human but as the presence of something else. The extensive concern with natural history in all the major figures of the wilderness tradition strongly supports this non-dualistic interpretation of wilderness as presence. And if wilderness is not simply the absence of human touch, then valuing and preserving it need not lead to misanthropy. People visiting but not remaining is not the essence of wilderness but a practical strategy for protecting what is essential to wilderness: the living, active presence of nonhuman nature, whether it be grizzly bears or giant trees.

Other responses have come from the new conservationists, a diverse alliance of wilderness activists and conservation biologists, which have pushed for a much more aggressive preservation strategy in the 90s and 2000s. The Wildlands Project, for example, proposed a map of wilderness areas, buffer zones and wildlife corridors that puts 50% of the contiguous US into some form of protected status. James Turner suggests that this more aggressive strategy precipitated the great new wilderness debate (2012). But the new conservationists, such as Reed Noss and Dave Foreman, are clear that their sense of wilderness is largely about securing the wildlife habitat necessary to mitigate the extinction crisis (Foreman 1995, 1998 and Noss 1991). Rather than looking for lands supposedly never touched by people, they seek to restore much land that is presently heavily trammeled and dominated by the works of man. And rather than seeing nature as static, their pursuit of bigger and bigger wilderness areas is driven by an increased understanding of landscape dynamics and of the population sizes needed for evolution to occur.

The legacy of wilderness in America thought and policy is complex, with some parts that have many opponents (for example, the erasure of indigenous cultures and histories) and some that have very wide appeal (for example, the national parks). The writings of Thoreau, Muir and Leopold have enriched and enchanted the lives of many Americans. The National Wilderness Preservation System has been remarkably successful at preserving large roadless areas, and many conservation biologists see an extension of this strategy as the best hope for protecting biodiversity. Others have found the cultural baggage of wilderness too great, and would prefer to take other strategies, hoping to better integrate the human economy with natural systems. Clearly wilderness preservation cannot solve all environmental problems, such as environmental injustice or climate change, but it may help with a lot of problems, even those.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Abbey, Edward. Desert Solitaire: A Season in the Wilderness. (New York: McGraw Hill, 1968).
    • An influential articulation of a wilderness philosophy, this book was written after the Wilderness Act but early in the process of review and designation. It is deeply imbued with an appreciation of the desert southwest.
  • Bartram, William. Travels and Other Writings. Thomas P. Slaughter, ed. (New York: Library of America, 1996).
  • Bartram’s Travels, first published in 1791.
    • His major literary work, representing natural history in a romantic mode and a literary genre of significant importance for the growing wilderness appreciation.
  • Bugbee, Henry. The Inward Morning: A Philosophical Exploration in Journal Form (Athens, Ga: University of Georgia Press, 1999). First published in 1958.
    • A remarkable and beautiful use of wilderness for understanding reality and our place in it. Deep Thoreauvian reflections in dialogue with mid-20th century philosophy.
  • Callicott, J. Baird. “The Conceptual Foundations of the Land Ethic.” Companion to A Sand County Almanac: Interpretive and Critical Essays. J. Baird Callicott, ed. (Madison: University of Wisconsin Press, 1987): 186-217.
  • Callicott, J. Baird. “The Wilderness Idea Revisited: The Sustainable Development Alternative” The Environmental Professional 13 (1991): 235-47. Reprinted in The Great New Wilderness Debate.
  • Callicott, J. Baird and Michael Nelson, eds. The Great New Wilderness Debate (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1998).
    • A comprehensive collection of contemporary wilderness criticism, including a selection of important works from across the history of the wilderness tradition.  It also includes several significant original pieces.
  • Callicott, J. Baird and Michael Nelson, eds. The Wilderness Debate Rages On: Continuing the Great New Wilderness Debate (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 2008).
    • A second large collection, this volume includes a lot of the critical scholarship on wilderness published since the first collection. It also covers some gaps in the previous volume, including important works by early 20th century ecologists and more discussion of race and class.
  • Chipeniuk, Raymond. “The Old and Middle English Origins of ‘Wilderness.’” Environments 21(1991): 22-28.
  • Coates, Peter. Nature: Western Attitudes since Ancient Times (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1998).
    • This book is especially helpful on Roman and Medieval times, often skipped over in other treatments, and it balances the history of ideas with the history of the environment, considering ancient impacts in some depth.
  • Cole, David N. and Laurie Yung, eds. Beyond Naturalness: Rethinking Park and Wilderness Stewardship in an Era of Rapid Change. 2nd ed. (Washington, D.C.: Island Press, 2010).
    • Diverse approaches to interpreting naturalness and wildness are considered in light of the practical management of protected areas and the challenges currently facing such management, including climate change and invasive species.
  • Cronon, William, ed. Uncommon Ground: Rethinking the Human Place in Nature. (New York: W. W. Norton & Company, 1995).
    • This anthology is largely critical of the idea of wilderness and includes Cronon’s much discussed piece, “The Trouble with Wilderness, or, Getting Back to the Wrong Nature.” It includes several other worthwhile chapters as well, particularly Anne Spirn’s chapter on the legacy of Frederick Law Olmsted.
  • Emerson, Ralph Waldo. Nature (Boston: James Munroe & Company, 1836).
    • Emerson’s classic is widely available in print and on the internet, including a scanned image of the 1836 original.
  • Friskics, Scott. “The Twofold Myth of Pristine Wilderness: Misreading the Wilderness Act in Terms of Purity” Environmental Ethics 30 (2008): 381-99.
  • Foreman, Dave. “Wilderness Areas for Real.” The Great New Wilderness Debate.. J. Baird Callicott and Michael Nelson, eds. (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1998): 395-407.
  • Foreman, Dave. “Wilderness: From Scenery to Nature” Wild Earth 5(4) (Winter 1995/96): 9-16. Reprinted in The Great New Wilderness Debate.
  • Guha, Ramachandra. “Radical American Environmentalism and Wilderness Preservation: A Third World Critique.” Environmental Ethics 11 (1989): 71-83. Reprinted in The Great New Wilderness Debate.
  • Harding, Walter. The Days of Henry Thoreau: A Biography. 2nd ed. (Mineola, NY: Dover Publications, 2011).
    • First published by Knopf in 1965, this biography has seen many printings. See also Richardson, 1988.
  • Hargrove, Eugene C. Foundations of Environmental Ethics (Denton: Environmental Ethics Books, 1996).
    • First published in 1989, this work is valuable for its discussion of the history of property rights and their tension with preservation. It also defends the viability of aesthetic arguments for preservation and their connection to wildlife conservation.
  • Harvey, Mark. Wilderness Forever: Howard Zhaniser and the Path to the Wilderness Act (Seattle: University of Washington Press, 2005).
    • Zhaniser was the primary author of the Wilderness Act and a driving force behind its eventual passage.
  • Leopold, Aldo. A Sand County Almanac and Sketches Here and There. Special Commemorative Edition (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1987). First published in 1949.
    • Aldo Leopold’s most influential work, accepted for publication just before his death. The last section of the book, called the “Upshot,” contains the most direct discussion of wilderness and the land ethic.
  • Leopold, Aldo. The River of the Mother of God and Other Essays. Susan L. Flader and J. Baird Callicott, eds. (Madison: University of Wisconsin Press, 1991).
    • Many of Leopold’s other works, arranged chronologically, enabling the reader to see the development of his thought over time.
  • Lewis, Michael. American Wilderness: A New History (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007).
    • An anthology covering diverse aspects of the history of wilderness and preservation in America, updating and complementing Nash’s work in several ways. For instance, it includes a chapter chronicling the extensive role of women and women’s clubs in the early preservation movement.
  • Lowenthal, David. George Perkins Marsh: Prophet of Conservation (Seattle: University of Washington Press, 2000).
    • A scholarly biography situating Marsh’s life and work in relation to the early conservation movement.
  • Marsh, George Perkins. Man and Nature; or, Physical Geography as Modified by Human Action (New York: Charles Scribner, 1864).
    • Immensely influential on the beginnings of the conservation movement, this work by Marsh first clearly established that human labor in nature is often more destructive than helpful. He focuses on the role of forests and deforestation on the condition of waters and soils and on the possibility of people working to heal or restore damaged land.
  • Meine, Curt D. Aldo Leopold: His Life and Work (Madison: University of Wisconsin Press: 1988).
    • This is the foremost biography of Leopold. The 2010 edition has a new preface and a contribution from Wendell Berry.
  • Muir, John. Our National Parks. (Boston: Houghton, Mifflin & Company, 1901).
  • Muir, John. Nature Writings. William Cronon, ed. (New York: Library of America, 1997.)
    • Most of Muir’s writings were published first as magazine articles, and later collected into books. This collection contains many of the most influential pieces.
  • Nash, Roderick Frazier. Wilderness and the American Mind. 5th ed. (New Haven: Yale, 2014)
    • First published in 1967, this work was path breaking scholarship and has had enduring popularity with wilderness enthusiasts and activists. Several chapters have been added in subsequent additions, and the 5th edition includes a forward by Char Miller.
  • Nash, Roderick Frazier. “‘Wild-d­ēor-ness,’ The Place of Wild Beasts.” Wilderness: the Edge of Knowledge. Maxine E. McCloskey, ed. (San Francisco: Sierra Club, 1970):  34-37.
  • Norton, Bryan G. “The Constancy of Leopold’s Land Ethic.” Conservation Biology 2(1) (1988): 93-102.
  • Noss, Reed. “Wilderness Recovery: Thinking Big in Restoration Ecology.” The Environmental Professional 13 (1991): 225-34. Reprinted in The Great New Wilderness Debate.
  • Oelschlaeger, Max. The Idea of Wilderness (New Haven: Yale, 1991).
    • Extensive treatment of the major figures of the wilderness tradition. Includes a notable chapter on the poets Robinson Jeffers and Gary Snyder.
  • Plumwood, Val. “Wilderness Skepticism and Wilderness Dualism.” The Great New Wilderness Debate. J. Baird Callicott and Michael Nelson, eds. (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1998): 652-690.
  • Richardson, Robert. Henry Thoreau: A Life of the Mind (Oakland: University of California Press, 1988).
    • This biography focuses on the intellectual development of Thoreau, with critical discussion of his written work.
  • Sachs, Aaron. The Humboldt Current: Nineteenth-Century Exploration and the Roots of American Environmentalism (New York: Viking, 2006.)
    • Sachs provides an in depth discussion of the influence of romantic natural history, especially in the person of Alexander von Humboldt, on American culture and attitudes toward nature.
  • Smallwood, William Martin. Natural History and the American Mind (New York: AMS Press, 1967).
    • Chronicles the development of natural history and its cultural importance in the American colonies and the young republic.
  • Spence, Mark David. Dispossessing the Wilderness: Indian Removal and the Making of the National Parks (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999).
  • Sutter, Paul. Driven Wild: How the Fight Against Automobiles Launched the Modern Wilderness Movement (Seattle: University of Washington Press, 2002).
  • Thoreau, Henry David. The Journal of Henry D. Thoreau. 14 volumes. B. Torrey and F. Allen, eds. (New York: Dover, 1962). Originally published in 1906.
  • Thoreau, Henry David. Walden: A Fully Annotated Edition. Jeffrey S. Cramer, ed. (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2004).
  • Thoreau, Henry David. Essays: A Fully Annotated Edition. Jeffrey S. Cramer, ed. (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2013).
    • This volume contains “Walking” and his most important wilderness travel and natural history writings.
  • Turner, Frederick Jackson. The Frontier in American History (New York: Henry Holt & Company, 1921).
    • Turner’s “frontier thesis” was originally given as an address in 1893, just after the census declared the end of the frontier. The idea gave fervor to the growing frontier nostalgia, and its accuracy as history has been long debated.
  • Turner, Jack. The Abstract Wild. (Tucson: University of Arizona Press, 1996).
    • A manifesto and sustained argument against, among other things, the sufficiency of managed parks for the preservation of wildness.
  • Turner, James Morton. “From Woodcraft to ‘Leave No Trace’: Wilderness, Consumerism, and Environmentalism in Twentieth-Century America” Environmental History 7(3) (2002): 462-84. Reprinted in The Wilderness Debate Rages On.
  • Turner, James Morton. The Promise of Wilderness: American Environmental Politics since 1964 (Seattle: University of Washington Press, 2012).
    • This work picks up the history where Nash’s book left off, successfully putting to rest any notion that public lands preservation has been less important to environmentalism since the 60s. This is the best source on the way different agencies and organizations have interpreted wilderness in applying the legal designation.
  • White, Lynn, Jr. “The Historical Roots of Our Ecological Crisis.” Science 155 (1967): 1203-07.
  • Woods, Mark. “Federal Wilderness Preservation in the United States: The Preservation of Wilderness?” The Great New Wilderness Debate. J. Baird Callicott and Michael Nelson, eds. (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1998): 131-153.
  • Worster, Donald. A Passion for Nature: The Life of John Muir (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2008).
    • An extensive biography of Muir by one of the foremost environmental historians.
  • Worster, Donald. Nature’s Economy: A History of Ecological Ideas. 2nd ed. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994).
    • This is an important treatment of the romantic natural history tradition and its legacy in general, and of Thoreau in particular.


Author Information

David Henderson
Western Carolina University
U. S. A.


Cultural diversity has been present in societies for a very long time. In Ancient Greece, there were various small regions with different costumes, traditions, dialects and identities, for example, those from Aetolia, Locris, Doris and Epirus. In the Ottoman Empire, Muslims were the majority, but there were also Christians, Jews, pagan Arabs, and other religious groups. In the 21st century, societies remain culturally diverse, with most countries having a mixture of individuals from different races, linguistic backgrounds, religious affiliations, and so forth. Contemporary political theorists have labeled this phenomenon of the coexistence of different cultures in the same geographical space multiculturalism. That is, one of the meanings of multiculturalism is the coexistence of different cultures.

The term ‘multiculturalism’, however, has not been used only to describe a culturally diverse society, but also to refer to a kind of policy that aims at protecting cultural diversity. Although multiculturalism is a phenomenon with a long history and there have been countries historically that did adopt multicultural policies, like the Ottoman Empire, the systematic study of multiculturalism in philosophy has only flourished in the late twentieth century, when it began to receive special attention, especially from liberal philosophers. The philosophers who initially dedicated more time to the topic were mainly Canadian, but in the 21st century it is a widespread topic in contemporary political philosophy. Before multiculturalism became a topic in political philosophy, most literature in this area focused on topics related to the fair redistribution of resources; conversely, the topic of multiculturalism in the realm of political philosophy highlights the idea that cultural identities are also normatively relevant and that policies ought to take these identities into consideration.

To understand the discussion of multiculturalism in contemporary political philosophy, there are four key topics that should be taken into consideration; these are the meaning of the concept of ‘culture’, the meaning of the concept of ‘multiculturalism’, the debate about justice between cultural groups and the discussion regarding the practical implications of multicultural practices.

Table of Contents

  1. The Concepts of Culture in Contemporary Political Theory
    1. The Semiotic Perspective
    2. The Normative Conception
    3. The Societal Conception
    4. The Economic/Rational Choice Approach
    5. Anti-Essentialism and Cosmopolitanism
  2. The Concept of Multiculturalism
    1. Multiculturalism as a Describing Concept for Society
    2. Multiculturalism as a Policy
      1. Multicultural Citizenship
        1. Taylor's Politics of Recognition
        2. Kymlicka's Multicultural Liberalism
        3. Shachar's Transformative Accommodation
      2. Negative Universalism
        1. Barry's Liberal Egalitarianism
        2. Kukathas' Libertarianism
  3. The Second Wave of Writings on Multiculturalism
    1. Gays, Lesbians and Bisexuals
    2. Women
    3. Children
  4. Animals and Multiculturalism
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Concepts of Culture in Contemporary Political Theory

Multiculturalism is before anything else a theory about culture and its value. Hence, to understand what multiculturalism is it is indispensable that the meaning of culture is clarified. In this section, five concepts of culture that are predominant in contemporary political philosophy are outlined: semiotic, normative, societal, economic/rational choice and the anti-essentialist cosmopolitanism conceptions of culture. As Festenstein (2005) points out, these are not competing conceptions of culture, where each selects a distinct set of necessary and sufficient conditions for the right application of the predicate. Contrastingly, all these conceptions of culture defend, even though in slightly different ways, the idea that culture is constitutive of personal identity. Therefore, it is possible to simultaneously defend, say, a semiotic conception of culture and admit that a culture may have normative, societal, economic and cosmopolitan features.

a. The Semiotic Perspective

The semiotic conception of culture was very popular in the 1960s, and has its roots in classic social anthropology. Social anthropologists like Margaret Mead, Levi-Straus and Malinowski considered culture as a set of social systems, symbols, representations and practices of signification held by a certain group. Thus, from this perspective, a culture is defined as a system of ideals or structures of symbolic meaning. Put differently, according to this view, culture should be understood as a symbolic system which in turn is a way of communication which represents the world. This form of communication is based on symbols, underlying structures and beliefs or ideological principles. One of the philosophers endorsing this perspective of culture is Parekh (2005). According to Parekh (2005, p. 139), human life is organized by a historically created system of meaning and significance and in turn this is what we call culture.

Taylor (1994b) who contends that human beings are self-interpreting animals, that is, human beings’ identities depend on the way each individual sees them self, also endorses this viewpoint. These self-understandings necessarily have to have meaning. Hence, the thesis that human beings are self-interpreting animals presupposes that human existence is constituted by meaning. In turn, this implies that human beings are also language animals. By language, what is meant are all modes of expression (music, spoken language, art and so forth) (Taylor, 1994b). To be language animals means that individuals are capable of creating value and meaning, and in Taylor’s view, these meanings have their origins in each individual’s cultural community. That is to say, language is, at least primarily, a result of the interaction of individuals with their own cultural community (Taylor, 1974; 1994b). More precisely, linguistic meanings and self-interpretations have their origins in individuals’ linguistic communities. Thus, culture is a system of symbolic meaning.

Bearing this in mind, it can be argued that the study of culture from the semiotic perspective is the analysis or elucidation of meaning. As in hermeneutics, where the reader has to interpret the meaning of a text, in culture one has to interpret its internal logic (Festenstein, 2005). An example of interpreting the internal logic of a culture could be given by the story told by Quine (1960) regarding the native who says ‘Gavagai!’ whenever he sees a rabbit. Quine (1960) suggests that there may be multiple meanings associated with this actions; it may mean ‘rabbit’, ‘food’, ‘an undetached rabbit-part’, ‘there will be a storm tonight’ (if the native is superstitious) and so forth. The symbolism, sign process or system of meaning underlying this action is what, according to the point of view of semiotics, culture is, and this is what should be studied. In short, it is the study of culture’s autonomous logic.

b. The Normative Conception

The normative conception of culture is usually adopted by communitarians. From this point of view, culture is important because it is what provides beliefs, norms and moral reasons, prompting individuals to act. Hence, part of what a person is includes their moral commitments; their practical identity is made up of these moral commitments, while their reasons to act are motivated by their moral commitments. In other words, according to the normative conception of culture, the term ‘culture’ refers to a group of norms and beliefs that are distinctive and which constitute the practical identify of a group of individuals; thereby, people’s values and commitments result, in part, from culture (Festenstein, 2005, p. 14). By way of illustration, part of what a Christian, a Muslim and a Jew are is constituted by the fact they abide or follow the moral teachings of the Bible, the Quran and the Torah, respectively. Therefore, understanding who one is is about understanding one’s moral commitments and therefore culture is norm-providing. Shachar (2001a, p. 2) is one of the philosophers who endorses this conception of culture. According to her, culture is a world view, both comprehensive and distinguishable, whereby community law is able to be created. To minority groups that have a culture, Shachar (2001a, p.2) attaches the label ‘nomoi communities’. According to her, this term can apply to religious, ethnic, racial, tribal and national groups, for all these groups exhibit the normative dimension required to be classified as a ‘nomoi community’.

The normative conception of culture is usually associated with the semiotic, in the sense that one does not contradict the other; in fact, they may be complementary. For instance, Taylor endorses both perspectives of culture. However, this is not necessary because the system of meaning and significance does not need to provide moral reasons in order to motivate action. From the semiotic perspective, what someone is is not necessarily his or her moral commitments; it can be anything within the system. That is, the system of meaning may be based on anything while, according to the normative conception of culture, culture is strong source of one’s moral commitments.

To explain how the semiotic and normative conceptions of culture can be compatible, consider Taylor’s conception of culture. Taylor considers that individuals are self-interpreting animals. The fact that individuals are thus entails that human existence is constituted by meanings. From the normative point of view, these meanings are moral evaluations/strong evaluations. This refers to the distinctions of worth that individuals make regarding objects of desire. In other words, it is a background of distinctions between things that individuals consider important or worthy and those things which are considered less valuable. From the normative perspective of culture, individuals direct their lives and purposes towards what they consider morally worthwhile. In short, these strong evaluations or moral frameworks are what indicate to individuals what is meaningful and rewarding. That is, they are motivated by these evaluations (Taylor, 1974). Therefore, the self has a moral dimension, in the sense that rationality and identity refer to moral evaluations. Identity is connected with morality because what individuals are is constituted by their self-interpretations, which are ultimately provided by strong evaluations (Taylor, 1974). These moral beliefs or strong evaluations are in turn provided by an individual’s culture–that is why this can be considered a normative conception of culture.

c. The Societal Conception

The societal conception of culture is a concept mainly used by the Canadian philosopher Kymlicka. In order to understand this, it is helpful to consider Kymlicka’s dual typology of the sources of diversity that exist in contemporary societies; for Kymlicka there are two kinds of diversity: polyethnic minorities and national minorities.

Kymlicka uses the term polyethnicity to refer to the kind of diversity resulting from immigration. Polyethnic minorities refer to what is commonly defined as ethnic groups. According to him, polyethnic groups are usually not territorially concentrated; rather they are dispersed around the country to which they migrated. Furthermore, Kymlicka affirms that they do not usually want to be segregated from the culture of the majority; rather they want to integrate with it, demanding policies that give them equal citizenship. For instance, these groups demand language rights, voting rights, places in parliament and so forth. However, even though this demand for equal citizenship is usually what polyethnic groups aspire to, this is not always the case. Kymlicka contends that polyethnic groups can be sub-divided into liberal and illiberal groups (Kymlicka, 2001, pp. 55-58). Liberal polyethnic groups have aspirations that do not go against liberal values, usually aspiring to be integrated into society, demanding policies for equal citizenship. As an example, Kymlicka usually refers to Latin-American immigrants living in the United States, who, in broad terms, make demands for language rights, such as an education curriculum in Spanish.

On the other hand, for Kymlicka, illiberal polyethnic groups are those where the culture and the demands to the state are not in accordance with liberal values. For example, some religious minority ethnic groups advocate the death penalty for gays within their groups; others have gendered and discriminatory norms in relation to divorce and marriage. Some of these groups have demands that are more similar to the ones of national minorities but Kymlicka contends that these cases are the exception, not the rule (Kymlicka, 1995, pp. 11-26, 97-99).

Polyethnic groups are not, in Kymlicka’s view, considered a culture; according to him, only nations are a culture. Kymlicka (1995, p. 18) uses the term nation interchangeably with the terms culture, people and societal culture, for example, “I am using ‘a culture’ as synonymous with ‘a nation’ or ‘a people’—that is, as an intergenerational community, more or less institutionally complete, occupying a given territory or homeland, sharing a distinct language and history”. In Kymlicka’s view, national minorities are a group in a society with a societal culture and a smaller number of members than the majority. Hence, a national minority is a societal culture where the amount of members is smaller in number than the amount of members of the majority. For Kymlicka (1995, p. 76) a societal culture is a kind of social setting that provides individuals with meaningful ways of life, both in the public and private sphere. These societal cultures are important mainly because they give individuals the groundwork from which they can make choices. More precisely for Kymlicka (1995, p. 76) due to the fact that societal cultures provide meaningful ways of life, they provide the social context that individuals need in order to make their own choices (that is, to be autonomous). Kymlicka’s rationale is that autonomy is only possible in certain social contexts and that social context is set up by societal cultures.

From Kymlicka’s point of view, national minorities or minority societal cultures usually share a number of characteristics. First, national minorities have settled in the country long ago. For example, most of the Amish communities in Pennsylvania settled there in the eighteenth century, as a result of religious persecution in Europe. Aborigines in Australia and many Native American groups in the USA have lived in that territory for a long period. Second, from Kymlicka’s point of view, these groups are often territorially concentrated; for example, Quebec and Catalonia are situated in specific geographic areas of Canada and Spain, respectively. In India, Sikhs are geographically concentrated mostly in the Punjab region. Third, according to Kymlicka, the institutions and practices of these groups provide a full range of human activities; this means that nations are embodied in common economic, political and educational institutions. These institutions are not based only on shared meanings, memories and values but include common practices and procedures. Put differently, nations are institutionally complete in the sense that they encompass a wide institutional elaboration that encompasses a variety of areas of life; they have their own governments, laws, schools and so forth. In Kymlicka’s view, the fourth characteristic that national minorities have in common is that they usually aspire to either total or partial segregation from the larger society. That is, these groups wish to be a totally or partially separate society, with a different state, governed by their own laws and institutions. Hence, national minorities, in Kymlicka’s view, do not want to integrate in the larger society; rather they wish to be able to have a certain degree of autonomy. For example, many Quebecois want to be able to have their own government institutions, run in the way they wish, like schools run in French. Often, the Amish want to be left alone, without intervention from the state in their internal affairs. More precisely, one of the demands of some Amish communities is that they are exempt from the basic educational requirements that other citizens of the USA have to abide by, namely, the minimum literacy requirements. This, as will be explained later on, relates to other set of normative questions about what groups can and cannot impose to their members. In order to address this problem, Kymlicka draws a distinction between practices that can be imposed (external protections) and practices that cannot be imposed (internal restrictions).

From Kymlicka’s point of view, national minorities can further be sub-divided into liberal and illiberal minorities. The former are those whose demands are compatible with liberal values, that is, their demands do not violate individuals’ rights and liberties. Under the concept of liberal national minorities are examples like Quebecois and Catalonians; these national minorities usually demand the right to use a different language in schools and their other institutions, and this does not necessarily violate any liberal value. The concept of illiberal national minorities refers to groups that wish to endorse illiberal values, like the death penalty for gays and lesbians.

d. The Economic/Rational Choice Approach

Rational choice is a theory that aims to explain and predict social behavior. From the viewpoint of rational choice, individuals act self-interestedly when they take into consideration their preferences and the information available. Self-interest means that individuals tend to maximize what is valuable for them. In other words, human behavior is goal-oriented. It is goal oriented by its preferences, that is, individuals act according to their preferences. For instance, if an individual prefers a hot chocolate to a vanilla milkshake or a strawberry milkshake and all the options are available, he will choose hot chocolate (other things being equal).

According to the rational choice view, the information available strongly affects behavior. By way of illustration, if an individual does not know that hot chocolate is available he will not choose it. Thus individuals act according to their self-interest, information and preferences. If a certain person’s preference is to buy the tastiest hot chocolate and this person has the information that the tastiest hot chocolate is sold ina particular store, then this person will act in order to achieve her/his own interest, that is, by going to that store and purchasing it there. Obviously, these actions are limited by the options available and by the actions of others. Therefore, if there is no hot chocolate on the market, this person will not be able to buy it–the option is not available because the suppliers decided not to offer hot chocolate. In this sense, an individual’s are dependent on their circumstances and on the actions of others.

With these premises in mind, a possible definition of culture from a rational choice perspective is provided by Laitin (2007, p. 64), whereby culture is:

an equilibrium in a well-defined set of circumstances in which members of a group sharing in common descent, symbolic practices and/or high levels of interaction—and thereby becoming a cultural group—are able to condition their behavior on common knowledge beliefs about the behavior of all members of the group.

Therefore, there are four key features of this conception of culture. First, a cultural group is a group in which individuals share a certain number of characteristics that differentiate them from other individuals–for example, language or religion. Second, all these individuals share a high degree of common knowledge. What common knowledge means in this context is that the members of a certain culture have shared information and mutual expectations about the actions and beliefs of others in the group. Third, there is a cultural equilibrium when the incentive to act or the self-interest to act is according to the beliefs of his or her own culture. More precisely, a cultural equilibrium occurs when individuals’ have an interest in acting in accordance with the norms and practices of their culture. These norms and practices can be any, but Laitin (2007) provides an insightful example with respect to the old Chinese tradition of foot binding. Laitin explains that it was very difficult for Chinese women to marry a man if they did not engage in the foot binding tradition. In this case, most Chinese parents forced their daughters to engage in this practice owing to the fact that their interest in finding a husband to their daughters was in accordance with the cultural practice of foot binding.  Finally, a well-defined set of circumstances can be described as a kind of situation where the type of interactions that members have with each other are ones of coordination and not conflict. That is, individuals’ actions are ones that are arranged in a way that match or complement each other, rather than being in conflict.

e. Anti-Essentialism and Cosmopolitanism

The concepts of culture mentioned above have been strongly criticized by some political theorists. Some of these, who direct their criticisms mostly to the semiotic, normative and societal conceptions of culture, argue that these conceptions are essentialist views of culture that inaccurately describe social reality. However, as Festenstein (2005) has pointed out, these criticisms are sometimes misplaced, that is, these conceptions of culture do not necessarily need to be essentialist.

In general terms, from an essentialist point of view, there is a distinction between the essential and accidental properties that the different kinds of objects and subjects may have. Accidental properties are properties that are not necessarily present in all members of a certain group of objects or subjects. Essential properties are those that define the objects or subjects, that is, objects or subjects necessarily need to have these properties in order to be members of a certain group. Furthermore, members of other groups do not have this property or set of properties; otherwise they too would belong to this group. By way of illustration, a bookshelf in order to be a bookshelf has to necessarily be constructed in a way that makes it possible to hold books–this is its essential property. The fact that a specific bookshelf is brown, black or blue is an accidental property–it does not change what the object is and it is indifferent to its definition. These properties are necessary and sufficient not only to include a certain object or subject in the group but also to exclude any object or subject which does not share these properties. Bearing this in mind, it can be concluded that essences are given by differences and similarities; for what defines a subject is what it has in common with the subjects of the same group, which in turn is a characteristic that other groups do not have.

In terms of what this means to culture, it means identifying the social characteristics or attributes that make the group what it is, and that all members of that group necessarily share. Moreover, these characteristics are what differentiate members of that group from others and clearly exclude others (Young, 2000a, p. 87). For example, for an essentialist, to classify Muslims as Muslims means to identify a certain characteristic, like shared practices and beliefs, common to all of the individuals who identify as Muslims. Thus, essentialism applied to culture would be that a certain culture means having a certain characteristic or set of characteristics that all members share, and which no one outside the group does. Hence, from this point of view, the identity of the group is constituted by the set of properties or attributes which are essential to this particular group (Young, 2000a).

According to the critics of essentialism, this theory necessarily makes two wrong assumptions about culture. First, the critics state that essentialists wrongly affirm that cultures are clearly demarcated wholes and their practices and beliefs do not overlap with other cultures. Thus, according to this argument, essentialists wrongly affirm that beliefs and practices are exclusive to each culture. This premise is necessary for defending essentialism because from an essentialist point of view; different groups cannot share the same essential properties; otherwise they would belong to the same group. Second, essentialists, according to these critics, wrongly picture cultures as internally uniform or homogeneous. Put differently, essentialists consider that individuals with the same culture all agree and interpret practices in the same way. Furthermore, they all place the same value on the practices of the group. This second premise is necessary for essentialist thinking owing to the fact that a group has to have a property or a set of properties that is predicated of all individuals in order for them to be members of this group.

This essentialist perspective of culture has however been widely contested. The general argument is that essentialism stereotypes and makes abusive generalizations of what groups are. That is to say, according to the critics, essentialism is descriptively inaccurate. Criticism of this perspective contends that the first premise lacks empirical evidence. There is no evidence that there is any exclusivity in terms of practices and beliefs, in fact, evidence suggests the opposite; cultures borrow practices and beliefs in order to increase their fitness. Cultures are not bounded, owing to the fact that culture is constantly changing, influenced by local, national and global resources (Phillips, 2007a; 2010). Hence, according to this view, it is not possible to clearly demarcate the boundaries of cultures because they share a number of practices and beliefs. There is significant overlapping of cultures, especially in neighboring cultures. The distinction between cultures is, therefore, overemphasized–the boundaries between cultures not being clearly demarcated (Benhabib, 2002; Phillips, 2007a).

With regards to the second premise, the criticism contends that it is false to say that there is internal homogeneity inside a group in terms of needs, interests and beliefs. Rather, the social actors of cultural groups have different needs, interests and interpretations about the beliefs and practices of groups. Furthermore, in many cases, they consider these practices and beliefs quite contestable, discussable and open to different interpretations. Therefore, there is wide disagreement about cultural meaning (Benhabib, 2002). Anti-essentialists contend that there are too many exceptions to make essentialist claims. Therefore, there are a considerable number of counter-examples to this generalization (Phillips, 2007a; 2010; Schachar, 2001a). As a consequence, some anti-essentialists usually argue that these categories should be substituted by thinner categories. Thus, rather than speaking about women, one should speak about black women, or lesbian Muslim women.

Taking this into consideration, different, more flexible conceptions of culture have been suggested; perhaps the most well-known being the cosmopolitan conception of culture, defended by Waldron. In Waldron’s view, cultures are dynamic and in continuous creation and interchange (Waldron, 1991). Consequently, cultures overlap with each other, making it impossible to attribute exclusive properties to one single culture and to differentiate between them. In other words, according to this view, there is a mélange of cultures because people move between cultures by enjoying the opportunities that each provides. Hence, individuals live in a kaleidoscope of cultures, within which they enjoy and borrow practices (Waldron, 1996).

A question that arises is whether this criticism entails that any attempt to define culture is mistaken. Some anti-essentialists like Narayan (1998) contend that this is not the case. Rather, she contends that cultures can be defined if two points are taken into consideration. First, cultures are fluid and constantly changing; hence, any definition of culture should consider that cultures are always in flux. Second, broader categories should be substituted by thinner categories. This means that rather than using terms like ‘African Culture’, one should use terms like ’Tutsi culture in Rwanda’.

2. The Concept of Multiculturalism

In general terms, within contemporary political philosophy, the concept of multiculturalism has been defined in two different ways. Sometimes the term ‘multiculturalism’ is used as a descriptive concept; other times it is defined as a kind of policy for responding to cultural diversity. In the next section, the definition of multiculturalism as a descriptive concept will be explained, followed by a clarification of what it means to use the term ‘multiculturalism’ as a policy.

a. Multiculturalism as a Describing Concept for Society

The term ‘multiculturalism’ is sometimes used to describe a condition of society; more precisely, it is used to describe a society where a variety of different cultures coexist. Many countries in the world are culturally diverse. Canada is just one example, including a variety of cultures such as English Canadians, Quebecois, Native Americans, Amish, Hutterites and Chinese immigrants. China is another country that can also be considered culturally diverse. In contemporary China, there are 56 officially recognized ethnic groups, and 55 of these groups are ethnic minorities who make up approximately 8.41 percent of China’s overall population. The other ethnic group is that of Han Chinese, which holds majority status (Han, 2013; He, 2006).

There are a variety of ways whereby societies can be diverse, for example, culture can come in many forms (Gurr, 1993, p. 3). Perhaps the chief ways in which a country can be culturally diverse is by having different religious groups, different linguistic groups, groups that define themselves by their territorial identity and variant racial groups.

Religious diversity is a widespread phenomenon in many countries. India can be given as an example of a country which is religiously diverse, including citizens who are Sikhs, Hindus, Buddhists, among other religious groups. The US is also religiously diverse, including Mormons, Amish, Hutterites, Catholics, Jews and so forth. These groups differentiate from each other via a variety of factors. Some of these are the Gods worshiped, the public holidays, the religious festivals and the dress codes.

Linguistic diversity is also widespread. In the 21st century, there are more than 200 countries in the world and around 6000 spoken languages (Laitin, 2007). Linguistic diversity usually results from two kinds of groups. First, it results from immigrants who move to a country where the language spoken is not their native language (Kymlicka, 1995). This is the case for those Cubans and Puerto Ricans who immigrated to the United States; it is also the case for Ukrainian immigrants who moved to Portugal.

The second kind of groups that are a cause of linguistic diversity are national minorities. National minorities are groups that have either settled in the country for a long time, but do not share the same language with the majority. Some examples include Quebecois in Canada, Catalans and Basques in Spain, and the Uyghur in China. Usually, these linguistic groups are territorially concentrated; furthermore, minority groups that fall into this category usually demand a high degree of autonomy. In particular, minority groups usually demand that they have the regional power to self-govern, that is, to run their territory as if it was an independent country or to succeed and become a different country.

A third kind of group diversity can results from distinct territory location. This territory location does not necessary mean that members of distinct cultures are, in fact, different. That is, it is not necessary that habits, traditions, customs, and so forth are significantly different. However, these distinct groups identify themselves as different from others because of the specific geographical area in which they are located. Possibly, in the UK, this is what distinguishes Scots from English. Even though there are historical differences between Scots and English, if one assumes that these two groups have little to distinguish themselves from each other, other than their geographical location, they would fit this third kind of group diversity. As mentioned above, these differences are conceptual and, in practice, cultural groups are characterized by a variety of features and not just one.

The fourth kind of group diversity is race. Races are groups whose physical characteristics are imbued with social significance. In other words, race is a socially constructed concept in the sense that it is the result of individuals giving social significance to a set of characteristics they consider that stand out in a person's physical appearance, such as skin color, eye color, hair color, bone/jaw structure and so forth. However, the mere existence of different physical characteristics does not mean that there is a multicultural environment/society. For instance, it cannot be affirmed that Sweden is multicultural because there are Swedes with blue eyes and others with green. Physical characteristics create a multicultural environment only when these physical characteristics mean that groups strongly identify with their physical characteristics and where these physical characteristics are socially perceived as something that strongly differentiates them from other groups. That is, racial cultural diversity is not simply the existence of different physical characteristics. Rather, these different physical characteristics must entail a sense of common identity which, in turn, are socially perceived as something that differentiates the members of that group to others. However, many times this idea of common identity is exaggerated, as Waldron’s argument suggests. For instance, even though there is the idea that a black culture exists in the United States, Appiah (1996) denies that such black culture exists, since there is no common identity among blacks in the United States. An example of a physical difference that is considered socially significant and, therefore, creates a multicultural society/environment can be seen in the Tutsis and Hutus of Rwanda. In general terms, Tutsis and Hutus are very similar, due to the fact that they speak the same language, share the same territory and follow the same traditions. Nevertheless, Tutsis are usually taller and thinner than Hutus. The social significance given to these physical differences are sufficient for members of both groups, broadly speaking, to identify as members of one group or the other, and subsequently oppose to each other.

Obviously, groups are not, most of the time, identified only by being linguistically different, territorially concentrated or religiously distinct. In fact, most groups have more than one of these characteristics. For instance, Sikhs in India, besides being religiously different, are also characterized, in general terms, by their geographical location. Namely, they are localized in the Punjab region of India. The Uyghur, from China, have a different language, are usually Muslims and are usually located in Xinjiang. Thus, the classification is helpful for understanding the characteristics of each group, but does not mean that these groups are simply defined by that characteristic.

b. Multiculturalism as a Policy

The term ‘multiculturalism’ can also be used to refer to a kind of policy. This kind of policy has two main characteristics. First, it aims at addressing the different demands of cultural groups. That is, it is a kind of policy that refers to the different normative challenges (ethnic conflict, internal illiberalism, federal autonomy, and so forth) that arise as a result of cultural diversity. For example, these are policies that aim at addressing the different normative challenges that arise from minority groups, like Quebecois, wishing to have their own institutions in a different language from the rest of Canada. To contrast with redistributive policies, multicultural policies are not primarily about distributive justice, that is, who gets what share of resources, although multicultural policies may refer to redistribution accidentally (Fraser, 2001). Multicultural policies aim at correcting the kind of disadvantages that some individuals are victims of, and that result from these individuals’ cultural identity. For instance, these are policies that aim at correcting a disadvantage that may result from someone being a member of a certain religion. In the case of some Muslims, this can mean addressing the problem of Muslims living in a Christian country and demanding different public holidays than the majority to celebrate their own festivals such as Eid-al-Fitr.

Second, multicultural policies are policies that aim at providing groups the means by which individuals can pursue their cultural differences. Put differently, multicultural policies have as their objectives, the preservation, allowance or celebration of differences between different groups. Consequently, multicultural policies contrast with assimilation. That is, according to the assimilationist view, it is acceptable that people are different, but the final goal of policies should be to make the minority group become part of the majority group, that is, to be accepted by those in the majority group, and to somehow find a consensus position between different cultures. Contrastingly, multiculturalism acknowledges that people have different ways of life and, in general terms, the state ought not to assimilate these groups but to give them the tools for pursuing their own ways of life or culture. That is, from a multiculturalist point of view, the final objective of policies is neither the standardization of cultural forms nor any form of uniformity or homogeneity; rather, its objective is to allow and give the means for groups to pursue their differences.

According to Kymlicka, in the context of contemporary liberal political philosophy, there have been two waves of writings on multiculturalism (Kymlicka, 1999a). This discussion of what policies ought to be undertaken in order to protect minority cultures is included in what Kymlicka called the first wave of the wave of writings on multiculturalism. In his view (1999a, p. 112), the first wave of writing focused on assessing to what extent it is just, from a liberal point of view, to give rights to groups so that they can pursue their cultural differences. In this first wave of writings, contemporary liberal political philosophers have discussed what kind of inequalities exist between majorities and minorities, and how these should be addressed. In other words, the discussion has been about what kind of intergroup inequalities exist, and what the state should do about them. In general terms, contemporary liberal political philosophers who have written about this topic have taken two different stands. On the one hand, some liberal political philosophers defend that state institutions should be blind to difference and that individuals should be given a uniform set of rights and liberties. In these authors’ views, cultural diversity, religious freedom and so forth are sufficiently protected by these sets of rights and liberties, especially by freedom of association and conscience. Therefore, those who stand for a uniform set of rights and liberties contend that ascribing rights on the basis of membership in a group is a discriminatory and immoral policy that creates citizenship hierarchies that are undesirable and unjust (Kymlicka, 1999a, pp. 112-113). Thus, in the view of these contemporary liberal philosophers, involvement in the cultural character of society is something that the state is under the duty to not do.

On the other hand, some philosophers have taken the opposite view on this matter. For example, there are some contemporary liberal political philosophers who are more sympathetic to the idea of ascribing rights to groups and have defended difference-sensitive policies. As Kymlicka (1999a, p. 112) points out, these contemporary liberal political philosophers have tried to show that difference-sensitive rules are not inherently unjust. In general terms, these contemporary political philosophers argue that a regime of difference-sensitive policies does not necessarily entail a hierarchization of citizenship and unfair privileges for some groups. Rather, they argue that difference-sensitive policies aim at correcting intergroup inequalities and disadvantages in the cultural market. Moreover, some of these philosophers contend that difference-blind policies favor the needs, interests and identities of the majority (Kymlicka, 1999a, pp. 112-114). These philosophers who consider that groups are entitled to special rights can be classified as a form of multicultural citizenship.

Those who defend special rights for groups have suggested a variety of policies. In his book The Multiculturalism of Fear, Levy (2000, pp. 125-160) systematically exposed the kinds of difference-sensitive policies that are usually discussed in the literature. According to him, difference-sensitive policies can be divided into eight categories: exemptions, assistance, symbolic claims, recognition/enforcement, special representation, self-government, external rules and internal rules.

Exemptions to laws are usually rights based on a negative liberty of non-interference from the state in a specific affair, which would cause a significant burden to a certain group. Or, to put it another way, exemptions to the law happen when the state abstains from interfering with or obliging a certain group who desire to practice something in order to diminish their burden. Exemptions can also be a limitation of someone else’s liberty to impose some costs on a certain group. Imagine that there is a general law that decrees corporations have the right to impose a dress code upon their employees. However, having this general law would burden those groups for whom dressing in a certain manner (that is, different from the one required by the company) is a very important value. For example, for many Sikh men and Muslim women it is very important to wear turbans and headscarves, respectively. Hence, it can be claimed that giving these individuals the option of either finding another job or rejecting their dress code can be a significant burden to them; given that the choice of dressing in a certain way is sometimes much harder for Sikh men and Muslim women than for a Westerner, and that it would undermine their identity, an exemption may be justified (Levy, 2000, pp. 128-133). Hence, these groups would be able to engage in practices that are not allowable for the majority of citizens.

Assistance rights aim to aid individuals in overcoming the obstacles they face because they belong to a certain group. In other words, assistance rights aim to rectify disadvantages experienced by certain individuals, as a result of their membership of a certain group, when compared to the majority. This can mean funding individuals to pursue their goals or using positive discrimination to help them in a variety of ways. Language rights are an example of this approach. Suppose that some individuals from Catalonia cannot speak Spanish. An assistance measure would be having people speak both Spanish and Catalan at public institutions, so that they can serve people from the minority as well the minority language group. Another example would be awarding subsidies to help groups preserve their cohesion by maintaining their practices and beliefs, and by allowing individuals from a minority to participate in public institutions as full citizens. Most of these practices are temporary, but they do not need to be (language rights, for example, are often not temporary) (Levy, 2000, pp. 133-137).

Symbolic claims refer to problems which do not affect individuals’ lives directly or seriously, but which may make the relations between individuals from different groups better. In a multicultural country, where there are multiple religions, ethnicities and ways of life, it may not make sense to have certain symbols that represent only a specific culture. Symbolic claims are ones that require, on the grounds of equality, the inclusion of all the cultures in a specific country in that country’s symbols. An example would be including Catholic, Sikh, Muslim, Protestant, Welsh, Northern Irish, Scottish, and English symbols on both the British flag and in the national anthem. Not integrating minority symbols may be considered as dispensing a lack of respect and unequal treatment to minorities.

Recognition is a demand for integrating a specific law or cultural practice into the larger society. If individuals want to integrate a specific law, they can ask for the law to become part of the major legal system. Hence, Sharia law could form part of divorce law for Muslims, while Aboriginal law could run in conjunction with Australian property rights law. It could also be a requirement to include certain groups in the history books used in schools–for example, to include the history of Indian and Pakistani immigrants in British history textbooks. Failing to integrate this law may bring a substantive burden to bear on individuals’ identity. In the Muslim case, because family law is of crucial importance to their identity, they may be considerably burdened by having to abide by a Western perspective of divorce. With regards to Aboriginal law, because hunting is essential for their way of life, if other individuals own the(ir) land this may undermine the Aboriginal culture.

Special representation rights are designed to protect groups which have been systematically unrepresented and disadvantaged in the larger society. Minority groups may be under-represented in the institutions of a society, and in order to place them in a position of equal bargaining power, it is necessary to provide special rights to the members of these groups. Hence, these rights aim to defend individuals’ interests in a more equal manner by guaranteeing some privileges or preventing discrimination. One way to achieve this is by setting aside extra seats for minorities in parliament (Kymlicka, 1995, pp. 131-152; Levy, 2000, pp. 150-154).

Self-government rights are usually what are claimed by national minorities (for example, Pueblo Indians and Quebecois) and they usually demand some degree of autonomy and self-determination. This sometimes implies demands for exclusive occupation of land and territorial jurisdiction. The reason groups sometimes may need these rights is that the kind of autonomy they give is a necessary condition by which individuals can develop their cultures, which is in the best interest of a culture’s members. More precisely, a specific educational curriculum, language right or jurisdiction over a territory may be a necessary requirement for the survival and prosperity of a particular culture and its members. This is compatible with both freedom and equality; it is compatible with freedom because it allows individuals access to their culture and to make their own choices; it is consistent with equality because it places individuals on an equal footing in terms of cultural access (Kymlicka, 1995, pp. 27-30; Levy, 2000, pp. 137- 138).

What Levy classifies as external rules can be considered as kinds of rights for self-government. They involve restricting other people’s freedom in order to preserve a certain culture. Hence, Aborigines in Australia employ external safeguards to protect their land. For example, freedom of movement is limited to outsiders who circulate in Aboriginal territory; furthermore, outsiders do not have the right to buy Aboriginal land. Demands that groups make for internal rules are those demands that aim at restricting individuals’ behavior within the group. Stigmatizing, ostracizing or excommunicating individuals from groups because they have not abided by the rules is what is usually meant by internal rules. Thus, this is the power given to groups to treat their members in a way that is not acceptable for the rest of society. An example can be if a certain individual marries someone from another group, which may then mean he is expelled from his own group. Another case is that of the Amish who want their children to withdraw from school earlier than the rest of society. In contrast to external rules, the restrictions on freedom apply to members of the group and not to outsiders. It is controversial whether internal rules are compatible with liberal values or not. On the one hand, authors like Kymlicka affirm they are not, because they undermine individuals’ autonomy, which is, in his view, a central liberal value. On the other hand, philosophers like Kukathas contend that liberals are committed to tolerance and, thereby, should accept some internal restrictions.

i. Multicultural Citizenship

Generally speaking, the philosophy of those authors who defend a multicultural citizenship, have five points in common. Firstly, they all contend that the state has the duty to support laws which defend the basic legal, civil and political rights of its citizens. Secondly, they argue that the state should participate in the construction of societal cultural character, thus its laws and policies should aim to protect culture. Thirdly, these philosophers contend that the character of culture is normative. Consequently, and this is the fourth common feature, individuals’ interest in culture is sufficiently strong enough that it needs to be supported by the state. Fifth, they both defend difference-sensitive/multicultural citizenship policies for protecting culture. Some of the philosophers who defend a multicultural citizenship are Taylor, Kymlicka and Shachar.

1. Taylor's Politics of Recognition

According to Taylor, there are two forms of recognition; intimate recognition and public recognition. Taylor (1994b, p. 37) mainly discusses the idea of public recognition or recognition in the public sphere. This form of recognition is about respect and esteem for one’s identity in the public realm; being misrecognized in the public realm means to have one’s identity disrespected in a way whereby one is treated as a second-class citizen. Being misrecognized, in this sense, is to have an unequal citizenship status in virtue of one’s identity. Hence, someone is misrecognized in the public sphere if one has a legal disadvantage that results from one’s identity. To have respect and esteem for someone in the public sphere means to have citizenship rights that do not disadvantage one’s identity. In Taylor’s view, misrecognition can potentially be a form of oppression and helps to create self-hating images in those who are misrecognized. Bearing this in mind, recognition is a vital human need because the relation between recognition and identity (the way people understand who they are) is relatively strong; hence, misrecognition or non-recognition may have a serious harmful effect on individuals

In order to discuss the best way to achieve recognition in the public realm, Taylor draws a distinction between procedural and non-procedural forms of liberalism. He affirms that, according to the procedural version of liberalism, a just society is one where all individuals have a uniform set of rights and freedoms, and having different rights for different people creates distinctions between first-class and second-class citizens: this liberalism is only committed to individual rights and rejects the idea of collective rights. The state, according to this version of liberalism, should not be involved in the cultural character of society and the procedures of this society must be independent of any particular set of values held by the citizens of that polity. In other words, the state should be neutral and independent of any conception of the good life.

In Taylor’s (1994b, p. 60) view, procedural liberalism is inhospitable to difference and is unable to accommodate different cultures. Taylor believes that, in some cases, collective goals need to be aided so that they can be achieved. Sometimes cultural communities need to have power over certain jurisdictions so that they can promote their own culture; this is something that a procedural liberalism does not offer, according to Taylor. Due to the fact that Taylor considers recognition as important, this kind of liberalism that is inhospitable to difference should be rejected; rather, in Taylor’s view, a non-procedural liberalism that is involved in the cultural character of society in a way that enhances cultural diversity and is not hostile to difference is the kind of liberalism that should be endorsed. From Taylor’s point of view, this non-procedural liberalism is not neutral between different ways of life and it is grounded in judgments of what the good life is. According to Taylor, this liberalism takes into account differences between individuals and groups and by taking these into account it creates an environment that is not hostile to the flourishing of different cultures. Engaging in policies that promote culture is, in Taylor’s view, extremely important; cultural communities deserve protection owing to the fact that they provide members with the basis of their identities. The language of cultures provides the framework for the question of who one is. Taylor believes that identity is strongly influenced by culture; therefore, there is a moral and social framework given by the language of one’s culture that individuals need in order to make sense of their lives. Therefore, recognition and protection of individuals’ cultural communities is required for respecting and preserving one’s identity. However, in Taylor’s view, this commitment to promoting difference is acceptable only if the measures taken to promote difference are constant with what he considers to be fundamental rights. Taylor specifically mentions the rights to life, liberty, due process, free speech and free practice of religion.

From Taylor’s point of view, this non-procedural liberalism has implications for public policy. It means that there should be decentralized power so that communities can flourish. However, what this decentralization and non-procedural liberalism imply in practice depends on the context; in different countries with different kinds of minorities there may be different implications. Taylor mostly writes about the Canadian context and he believes that in this context the best policy is a form of federalism. In his view, Quebec should be given self-government rights so that it has power over a certain number of policies. In particular, Taylor affirms that it should have sovereign power over art, technology, economy, labor, communications, agriculture, and fisheries. In the case of language policies, Taylor contends that in some cases it is justified to violate liberal values, like freedom of expression, in order to protect the language of a community. For instance, in the case of Quebec, communications in English can be restricted by the state in order to promote the French language.  Another example is that offspring of French parents do not have the option of choosing a language of instruction that is not French. Moreover, it should have shared power with the majority in immigration, industrial policy and environmental policy. Control over defense, external affairs and currency is given to the federal government. It is important to emphasize that, in Taylor’s view, federalism is not a necessary implication of non-procedural liberalism. Federalism is not at the core of the recognition idea; rather, federalism is a kind of system that Taylor considers is the adequate option in the Canadian context, which does not mean it is a good option in all contexts.

2. Kymlicka's Multicultural Liberalism

Kymlicka believes that group rights are compatible and promote the liberal values of freedom and equality. As a result, Kymlicka offers arguments that relate freedom and equality with group rights. The argument based on freedom is strongly related to his idea of societal culture. In Kymlicka’s perspective (1995, p. 80), societal cultures promote freedom. From Kymlicka’s point of view, the reason why societal cultures are important for freedom is because they give individuals the groundwork from which they can make choices. In particular, according to Kymlicka, because societal cultures provide a framework with meaningful ways of life, then they provide the social conditions that are necessary for individuals to make autonomous choices. Autonomy, in turn, is only possible if and only if these social conditions are the ones of individuals’ societal cultures.

Taking this on board, Kymlicka’s argument is that societal cultures ought to be protected because they promote the liberal value of autonomy; they promote this value because societal cultures give, in Kymlicka’s perspective, a context of choice that is necessary for individuals to exercise their freedom. Put differently, from Kymlicka’s point of view, individuals’ own cultures provide the groundwork that individuals need in order to make free choices. Consequently, if liberals are committed to this value, they are committed to protecting the conditions (societal cultures) to achieve it. This means that if group rights are necessary for protecting this context of choice, then they are justified from a liberal point of view; for if group rights can protect the context of choice, then they are promoting autonomy. As mentioned above, from the three sources of diversity only national minorities have societal cultures. Hence, this argument only justifies group rights for national minorities in order to protect their societal cultures. In Kymlicka’s view, the context of choice is given by the access to one’s own culture, not just to any culture. So according to this view, for someone from Quebec, the societal culture of Catalonia does not provide a context of choice; likewise, for someone from an Amish community, the societal culture of Sikhs in India does not provide this Amish individual with a context of choice.

The three arguments based on equality that Kymlicka offers for defending group rights rely on a different line of reasoning. The first argument starts by observing that there is an inevitable involvement in the cultural character of society by the state and it is impossible to be completely neutral. Kymlicka affirms that the decisions made by governments, like what public holidays to have, unavoidably promote a certain cultural identity. Consequently, those individuals who do not share the culture promoted by the state are disadvantaged. In other words, they are in an unequal position. More precisely, by observing the unequal treatment that results from the inevitable involvement in the cultural character of society by the state, Kymlicka contends that uniform laws giving the same rights to all individuals from different cultures treat individuals unequally. To take the example of public holidays, the establishment of Christian public holidays disadvantages Muslims because their main festival, Eid-al-Fitr, occurs at a time of the year when there are no public holidays. Bearing this in mind, Kymlicka argues that if liberals are committed to equality, then they should endorse a kind of public policy that does not advantage some individuals over others; this, in turn, means that in order to equalize the status of different groups, the state ought to entitle different groups to different rights.

In Kymlicka’s view, group rights can correct these inequalities by providing the necessary and sufficient means by which individuals can pursue their culture. Although the argument for autonomy only applies to national minorities, this argument based on equality refers to national minorities and polyethnic groups. Inequalities between majorities and national minorities can take many shapes, but an example that Kymlicka likes to use is language rights inequalities. From his point of view, national linguistic minorities like those of Quebec and Catalonia would be treated unequally if they did not have the right to have their own institutions in their national language. The debate about Christian and Muslim holidays is an example of inequalities between majorities and polyethnic groups. Taking this on board, it is Kymlicka’s (1995) conviction that the two kinds of diversity can potentially be treated unequally by a set of uniform laws. As a result, any of these three kinds of diversity are entitled to group rights on grounds of promoting equality between groups within a liberal state.

Kymlicka’s second argument based on equality is that if it is the case that all individuals in society should have it, then the state is committed to promote a variety of cultures so that individuals have more options relating to choice. This argument, however, is not directed at minorities but rather at majorities, and it does not refer to a need of the minority; instead, it refers to how culture can make individuals’ lives better in general, by providing more options. Furthermore, Kymlicka (1995, p. 121) considers that because it is difficult to change one’s culture, this would not be a very attractive choice for everyone.

The third argument is that, according to Kymlicka, liberals should respect historical agreements. In Kymlicka’s view, many of the rights that minority cultures have in the early 21st century are the result of historical agreements. If the state is to treat individuals from different cultures with equal respect, then it should respect these agreements.

3. Shachar's Transformative Accommodation

Shachar is another philosopher who has defended a kind of multicultural citizenship. Shachar endorses a joint governance model that she calls transformative accommodation. According to Shachar, this model relies on four assumptions. First, individuals have a multiplicity of identities. For example, Malcolm X was a Muslim, a male, an African-American, and a heterosexual. Hence, individuals have a multiplicity of affiliations that play a role in their identities. The second assumption is that both the group and the state have normative and legal reasons to shape behavior. There may be a variety of reasons for this, but at least one of them is that individuals have a strong interest both in preserving their cultures and protecting their individual rights. Third, both what the state and the group do impact on each other. For instance, the laws that the state makes about same-sex marriage has an impact on heterosexist minority groups; the heterosexism of minority groups, like the hate speech of the Westboro Baptist Church, also impacts on the state. Fourth, both the state and the group have an interest in supporting their members (Shachar, 2001a, p. 118).

On top of these four assumptions, transformative accommodation is based on three core principles; sub-matter allocation of authority, no monopoly, and the clear establishment of delineated options (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 118-119). According to the sub-matters allocation of authority principle, the holistic view that contested social arenas (family law, criminal law, employment law and so forth) are indivisible is incorrect. According to this principle, these social arenas can be divisible into sub-matters, that is, into multiple separable components that are complementary (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 51-54). In practice, this means that norms and decisions about disputed social matters can be determined separately. In other words, in each area of law, there are sub-areas and these sub-areas are partially independent; as a result, a decision made in a sub-area can be made independently of a decision made in another sub-area. In Shachar’s view, family law, for example, can be divided into demarcating and distributive sub-matters or sub-areas. In her (2001a, pp. 119-120) view, the demarcating sub-matter of family law is where group membership boundaries are defined. That is, it is in this sub-matter that the necessary and sufficient attributes (biological, ethnical, territorial, ideological and so forth) for membership are decided. The distributive sub-matter refers to the distribution of resources. For instance, it would be in the demarcating sub-matter where it would be decided who gets what after divorce.

To illustrate how this principle would work in practice, Shachar routinely uses a legal dispute that occurred with a Native-American tribe and one of their members. This is the case of Julia Martinez; Julia Martinez, was a member of the Santa Clara Pueblo tribe whose daughter’s membership of the group was rejected, a rejection leading to tragic consequences. In 1941, Julia Martinez, who was a daughter of members of the Santa Clara Pueblo tribe married a man from outside the group. With this man, she had a daughter, who was raised in the Pueblo reservation, subsequently participating in and learning the norms and practices of the tribe. However, according to this tribe’s law, only the offspring of male members are considered members; hence, although Julia Martinez’ daughter was raised on the reservation, she was not, in the eyes of the tribe leaders, a tribe member. When Julia Martinez’s daughter got ill, she had to go to the emergency section of the Indian Health Services. Nevertheless, she was refused emergency treatment on grounds of not being a member of the tribe; a refusal that later caused her death (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 18-20). According to the sub-matters principle, in the case of the Santa Clara Pueblo tribe, it would be the legislators in the demarcation sub-matter who would determine whether Julia Martinez’s daughter was a member of the tribe or not (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 52-54). Contrastingly, it would be in the distributive sub-matter would that her entitlement or not to use the Indian Health Services would be decided.

By establishing the second principle, the no monopoly rule, Shachar defends that jurisdictional powers should be divided between the state and the group. According to this principle, neither the state nor the group should hold absolute power over the contested social arenas. More precisely, the group should hold power over one sub-matter while the state should hold power over another. Consequently, legal decisions would result from an interdependent and cooperative relationship between the group and the state (Shachar, 2001a, pp. 120-122). In the case of family law, if there is a divorce dispute, the state could take control of distribution (for example, property division after divorce) and the group, demarcation (for example, who can request divorce and why) or vice-versa.

The third principle defended by Shachar is the definition of clearly delineated options. According to this principle, individuals should have clear options between choosing to abide by the state or the group jurisdiction. In particular, this means that individuals can either decide to abide by a jurisdiction or they can refuse to abide by it and exit that jurisdiction at predefined reversal points. These predefined reversal points are an agreement made between the state and the group, where it is decided when individuals can exit the group and in what circumstances.

ii. Negative Universalism

The other approach to the philosophical discussion about justice between groups can be called negative universalism (Festenstein, 2005). Two philosophers who endorse this approach are, according to Festenstein (2005), Barry and Kukathas. Despite the fact that the philosophies of Barry and Kukathas are different, as negative universalists, they have four features in common.

Firstly, both defend the neutrality of the state among different conceptions of the good. That is, individuals should be free to pursue their own conceptions of the good. Secondly, this impartiality does not have the same impact on all citizens’ lives, that is, some will be better-off than others. Nevertheless, this is not, according to these philosophers, a counter-argument against the liberal value of neutrality, because equality of impact is not a realistic goal. Thirdly, principles of liberal theory adopt ‘basic civil and political rights’ with differentiations that may be justified through fundamental basic rights such as freedom of thought and association. However, basic civil and political rights and justified deviations differ substantially when both are permitted simultaneously. Fourth, negative universalists are skeptical concerning the normative value of culture and about providing differentiated rights to individuals (Festenstein, 2005, pp. 91-92).

1. Barry's Liberal Egalitarianism

Barry’s view is that liberal egalitarianism is the philosophical doctrine that offers the most coherent and just approach to protect these interests. In addition, from his viewpoint, liberal egalitarianism offers the normative groundwork for the challenges that illiberal and heterosexist cultural groups raise. His liberal egalitarian approach, in particular, has as core values neutrality, freedom and equality.

According to Barry, neutrality means that states are under the duty of not promoting or favoring some conceptions of the good over others. In general terms, this means that state policy should not promote the survival and flourishing of a conception of the good, a language, a religion and so forth. Rather, neutrality requires that states be committed to individual rights without any sort of collective goal, besides those that correspond to universal basic interests. When the state favors a specific conception of the good by assisting it, it is violating neutrality (Barry, 2001, pp. 28, 29, 122). In Barry’s version of liberal neutrality, conceptions of the good are a private extra-political matter, which refer to personal affairs (Barry, 1995, p. 118). Hence, non-secular states, like Iran or Saudi Arabia, violate neutrality in Barry’s sense because they promote a specific religion.

The other important value for Barry, freedom, means not having paternalistic restrictions on pursuing one’s own conception of the good. This implies that individuals should be provided with a considerable amount of independence to pursue their own conceptions of the good. According to Barry, all individuals should be given the means for this pursuit. In practice, this means that all individuals are entitled to freedoms that enable them to pursue their own conceptions of the good and lifestyles; in particular, Barry considers that freedom of association and conscience play a fundamental role in enabling individuals in this pursuit. Individuals may choose to live a lifestyle that liberals may disapprove of; however, Barry (2001, p. 161) considers that bad choices are something that individuals in a liberal society are entitled to make.

Barry’s third commitment, the one to equality, translates into two core ideas. First, treating people equally means to furnish individuals with an equal set of basic legal, political and civil rights. That is, equality requires endorsing a unitary conception of citizenship. Second, the commitment to equality entails that the state has the duty to promote equality of opportunity. For Barry, there is an equal opportunity when uniform rules generate the same set of choices to all individuals (Barry, 2005). This means that there is equality of opportunity if and only if, in a specific situation, different individuals have the capacity to make the choice that is needed to achieve their aims. For example, imagine that Sam and John want both to be medical doctors; imagine that Sam is from a working class family and John from an upper class family. Sam does not have the economic resources to study, but John has. In such a situation, assuming that the economic factor is the only relevant factor for equalizing choice, in order to achieve equality of opportunity, Sam should be given a similar amount of economic resources to John, so that he has the same capacity to make the choice of a career in medicine. Therefore, equality of opportunity requires that individuals be treated according to their needs. Barry also argues that equality of opportunity entails that the is under the duty of equalizing choice sets, not equalizing the outcomes that result from the decisions people make in those choice sets.

Taking this normative groundwork on board, Barry offers six arguments against giving rights to cultural groups. Four of these are a result of his liberal theory; the other two are independent arguments not related to his theory.

The first argument against difference-sensitive policies for cultural groups presented by Barry is that this would be a violation of neutrality. For Barry, neutrality requires that there is no or little involvement in the cultural character of society; hence, if the state privileged a group either by promoting this group’s culture or by empowering the group with different rights from other groups, then the state would be violating neutrality. Barry believes that liberals are committed to non-interference in the cultural character of society; as a result, liberalism is incompatible with difference-sensitive policies. In practice, what this implies for multicultural demands is that any kind of exemption, recognition, assistance or any other kind of group right should be denied on the grounds of neutrality. For example, in Barry’s view, if a certain state does not criminalize homosexuality and the governing body of a minority religious group asks recognition of its religious courts that convict its gay members for same-sex acts, the state should not concede this recognition because doing so would be giving a different right to a different group and, therefore, it would be a violation of neutrality.

The second argument provided by Barry against group rights is that the unequal impact of policies on cultures is not an interference with freedom to pursue one’s own conception of the good. In Barry’s view, laws have the aim of protecting some interests against others; the fact that they have a different impact on a specific culture is not a sign of unfairness; rather, it is just a side effect of having laws (Barry, 2001, p. 34).

Third, in Barry’s view, the only group rights conceded, especially those exemptions to the law, are cultural practices that overlap with universal human interests. In other words, if the group right and, in particular the exemption to the law, promotes a universal human interest, then it is acceptable (Barry, 2001, pp. 48-50). For instance, Muslim girls cannot be refused education on the grounds of a minor issue such as dress codes, because education is a universal human interest.

Fourth, Barry contends that because neither culture nor cultural demands are a universal interest per se, then the unequal treatment that is acceptable for universal interests does not apply to these (Barry, 2001, pp. 12-13, 16). To recall, Barry’s conception of equality of opportunity entails that individuals can be treated unequally so that their choice sets are equalized. However, Barry affirms that these choice sets should be equalized only if these are choice sets about universal interests, which culture is not. In short, exemptions can and should be guaranteed for universal or higher-order interests but not for particular interests.

These four arguments are dependent on Barry’s liberal theory; they depend on his conception of freedom, neutrality and equality. To these arguments, he adds two ad hoc arguments. First, that difference-sensitive rights that aim to protect economic resources are temporary, while cultural rights are permanent. This means that those who need economic resources to equalize their choice sets only need this aid temporarily (Barry, 2001, pp. 12-13). Contrastingly, according to Barry, group rights to protect culture are required permanently. Like the case of the Sikh, a permanent law that exempted Sikhs from wearing helmets would be necessary. The other ad hoc argument is that when there is a reasonable argument it should be applied without exception. If there is a case for exception, then the rule should be abandoned. According to him, it is philosophically incoherent to provide a universal justification for a rule and then relativize the reason just given (Barry, 2001, pp. 32-50).

2. Kukathas' Libertarianism

Kukathas’ approach to multiculturalism is, broadly speaking, based on two ideas: these ideas are what he considers to be human beings’ most fundamental interest and his theory of freedom of association. Kukathas considers that human beings have only one fundamental interest: the interest in living according to their conscience. In his opinion, the reason for this is, in part, that human beings are primarily moral beings and, consequently, are disposed to direct their lives/purposes towards what they consider to be morally worthwhile. Consequently, from Kukathas’ point of view, individuals find it difficult to act against their conscience. This tendency to govern one’s own conduct primarily by conscience and the difficulty to act against one’s moral beliefs can, in Kukathas’ (2003b, p. 53) view, be observed and has empirical support. An additional reason why acting according to one’s own conscience is a fundamental interest is because, according to Kukathas, the meaning of life is given by conscience (Kukathas, 2003b, p. 55). Hence, Kukathas considers that identity is connected with morality because what individuals are is their self-interpretation, which ultimately is provided by moral evaluation. It is important to notice that this says nothing about what each person’s morality is. A human rights activist and a terrorist can be both acting according to their conscience even if they are doing opposite things. Owing to the fact that conscience is a fundamental interest, Kukathas contends that the state is under the duty to protect this interest.

The second important aspect of Kukathas’ philosophy is his defense of freedom of association. According to Kukathas, freedom of association is primarily defined as the right to exit groups, that is, freedom of association exists when individuals have the freedom to leave or dissociate from a group they are part of. In other words, essential to this version of freedom of association is the idea that individuals should not be forced to remain members of communities they do not wish to associate with. Therefore, according to this definition, freedom of association is not about the freedom of entering a specific group; rather, it is about the freedom to leave those groups that individuals want to dissociate from (Kukathas, 2003b, p. 95).

According to Kukathas, there are two necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for individuals to have the freedom to exit. These conditions are that individuals are not physically barred from leaving, and that there is a place similar to a market society where they can exit. From Kukathas’ point of view, a place to go is a necessary requirement for exit because it would not be credible to think that individuals had a right to exit if all communities were organized on a basis of kinship, for the options available would be either conformity to the rules or loneliness.

According to this theory of freedom, the functions of the state are quite limited. In Kukathas’ style of freedom of association, the state is not duty bound to secure individuals’ access to healthcare, education, and so forth. These forms of welfare should be provided by associations, if those associations wish to provide them. According to Kukathas’ theory, the state should only intervene to guarantee the right to exit, preserving the ongoing order of society by guaranteeing the safety and security of its citizens and preventing civil war. In practice, this means that the state has two functions. First, the state has to guarantee that there is no violation of freedom of association, that is, that individuals within associations are not being forced to remain members by being physically barred from leaving. Second, it means that the state should regulate so that there is no aggression between associations. So, even though associations can endorse practices that are extremely aggressive towards their members, it is a requirement for Kukathas that there is mutual toleration between associations. Societies cannot commit acts of aggression towards each other and, if they do, the state can, in his view, legitimately intervene to stop this aggression.

Bearing in mind the functions of the state and the internal structure of associations, this society would be a society of societies. Each society or group would have its own legislation, that is, they would have jurisdictional independence (Kukathas, 2003b, p. 97). In Kukathas’ view, the validity of the laws of communities only have local recognition, that is, the state would not recognize same-sex marriage and so forth; rather the state would be indifferent to the way individuals associate.

From Kukathas’ point of view, this version of freedom of association is compatible with the imposition of high costs of exit/dissociation and membership due to the fact that the magnitude of costs in a choice are not related to freedom (Kukathas, 2003b, pp. 107-109). In his view, this model of freedom of association is the best way to protect individuals’ freedom of conscience because it gives few restrictions to what individuals can do and consequently allows a wide variety of practices. For instance, an ethnic community where the members, generally speaking, believe that female genital mutilation is an important practice and that it is immoral not to engage in this practice, would be, in Kukathas’ view, better off if they had the possibility to form their own association where the practice would be accepted, then if they were part of a larger community with regulations against such practice.

3. The Second Wave of Writings on Multiculturalism

Taking this on board, in this first wave of writings on multiculturalism, the debate has centered on discussing the justice of difference-sensitive policies in the liberal context. On the whole, there are two difference positions taken by contemporary liberal political philosophers who have written on multiculturalism; some defend that difference-sensitive policies are justified, whereas others argue that they are a deviation from the core values of liberalism.

More recently, a second wave of writings on multiculturalism has appeared. In this, contemporary liberal political philosophers have not focused so much on debates about justice between different groups; rather, they have focused on justice within groups. Thus, the debate has changed to the analysis of the potentially perverse effects of policies to protect minority cultural groups with regard to the members of these minority cultural groups. Contemporary liberal political philosophers have now switched to discussing the practical implications that those that aimed at correcting inter-group equality could have for the members of those groups that the policies are directed to. In particular, the worry is that the policies for enabling members of minority groups to pursue their culture could favor some members of minority groups over others. That is, this new debate is about the risks that those policies for protecting cultural groups could have in undermining the status of the weaker members of these groups. The reason why philosophers worry about this is because the policies for multiculturalism may give the leaders of cultural groups’ power for making decisions and institutionalizing practices that facilitate the persecution of internal minorities. In other words, those policies may give group leaders all kinds of power that reinforce or facilitate cruelty and discrimination within the group (Phillips, 2007a, pp. 13-14; Reich, 2005, pp. 209-210; Shachar, 2001a, pp. 3, 4, 15-16).

Three kinds of internal minorities have received special attention from contemporary political philosophers: these are bisexuals, gays and lesbians, women and children.

a. Gays, Lesbians and Bisexuals

Some philosophers are concerned about how policies meant to protect minority cultural groups can potentially impose serious threats and harm the interests and rights of lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals. In some minority cultural groups, lesbian gay and bisexuals within minorities are very disadvantaged by the unintended consequences of multicultural politics (Levy, 2005; Swaine, 2005, pp. 44-45). Heterosexism is a cross-cutting issue in minority cultural groups (and society in general), covering diverse areas of life, ranging from basic freedoms and rights, employment, education, family life, economic and welfare rights, sexual freedom, physical and psychological integrity, safety, and so forth. In general terms, it can be affirmed that lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals have an interest in bodily and psychological integrity, sexual freedom, participation in cultural and political life, family life, basic civil and political rights, economic and employment equality and access to welfare provision.

Sometimes, lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals have their freedom of association, opinion, expression, assembly, and thought limited (European Union Agency for Fundamental Rights, 2009, pp. 50-55). Minority cultural groups can jeopardize these interests due to hierarchies of power within groups. Some groups use a variety of norms of social control. Also in some groups, participation in political decisions and freedom of expression is culturally determined.

In some minority cultural groups, lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals’ interest in being free from murder, torture, and other cruel, inhuman and degrading treatment is also sometimes violated (European Union Agency for Fundamental Rights, 2009, pp. 13-16). Many lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals are victims of physical and psychological harassment, murder, hate speech, hate crimes, brutal sexual conversion therapies, and corrective rape, among other kinds of physical and psychological violence.

Some minority cultural groups also sometimes undermine lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals’ interests in economic and welfare rights. In the case of employment, this refers to anti-discrimination law in the workplace and in admission for jobs. In some cases, lesbian, gay and bisexual individuals’ freedom and the right to join the armed forces, to work with children, to employment benefits and health insurance for same-sex families are denied. Although not many religious groups have armed forces, this example could apply to the Swiss Army that protects the Vatican.

Bearing this in mind, some contemporary political philosophers have discussed to what extent giving special rights to groups can potentially facilitate the imposition of such unequal and cruel practices.

b. Women

Some philosophers, especially liberal feminist philosophers, have raised concerns about the implications of providing special rights to groups for women. Okin has contended that most cultures in the world are patriarchal and gendered and, consequently, providing rights to groups may help with reinforcing oppressive gendered and patriarchal practices. Some of the practices that may jeopardize women’s rights are female genital mutilation, polygamy, the use of headscarves, and a lesser valuation of the career and education of women.

Female genital mutilation, a practice that some communities engage in, is considered by some feminists to be a cruel practice that undermines the sexual health of women and aims at controlling their bodies. Polygamy is a practice that some communities follow, with some feminists contending that this practice is deeply disrespectful to women, and a clear way of treating women unequally. The use of headscarves is considered by some feminists to be a way of controlling women’s bodies and showing submission to males. Taking this on board, the concern expressed by some feminists is that empowering groups with special rights may reinforce female oppression. For example, if some communities are exempt from the health practices of the majority of society, this may help them to perpetuate and spread the practice of female genital mutilation.

Nevertheless, it is important to emphasize that the view that cultures are necessarily patriarchal, gendered and oppressive for women is not a unanimous position among feminists. Indeed, Volpp (2001) and Phillips (2007a), for instance, have defended the position that many feminists take an ethnocentric point of view when analyzing minority practices and misunderstand the true meaning of practices. Furthermore, Volpp and Phillips contend that many women in minority cultures are agents capable of making their own choices; therefore some of those practices that can be considered oppressive from a Western point of view should not be banned.

c. Children

The implications of special rights to children who are members of minority cultures is also a topic that has received some attention from contemporary political philosophers (Reich, 2005). The concerns with respect to children are especially with regards to physical and psychological abuse and lack of education. With respect to physical and psychological abuse, some groups may have practices that are harmful for children. For example, some groups practice shunning, a practice that consists of ostracizing those who do not follow their norms or who have done something that is disapproved of by the community. The traditional scarification of children that some African communities practice is also a practice that may be considered to entail physical abuse. With respect to education, there are groups who wish to take their children out of school at an earlier age. Some may argue that removing children from school earlier than their peers may strongly disadvantage these children because they will potentially not acquire the minimum skills necessary to find a job, and will not receive enough education to make autonomous choices. Other groups consider that education should be mainly about the study of the religious scripture, and they sometimes disregard other kinds of education.

Owing to the fact that schools are a central vehicle of autonomy and cultural transmission and because children are at a formative age and, thereby, much more likely to be influenced by the way they are brought up, some political philosophers have shown concern about the impact of giving special rights to groups that may treat children inappropriately, indoctrinate them, and maybe disadvantage them when compared with children who are not members of those groups.

It is important to emphasize, however, that this is not to say that providing special rights to minority groups entails that children, women and gays, lesbians and bisexuals will be disadvantaged. Many postcolonial philosophers, like Mookherjee (2005), have contended that even though there may be worries about internal oppression, sometimes these worries are misplaced. Routinely, members of minority cultures see value in their cultural practices and wish to endorse them, despite the fact that these practices may look oppressive for outsiders. Furthermore, sometimes practices may seem illiberal to an outsider, but because their social meaning differs from the one given by the outsider, the practice is not illiberal (Horton, 2003).

4. Animals and Multiculturalism

Another topic that has not been explored very much is how multicultural policies can have perverse effects on non-human sentient animals. If a thin conception of non-human sentient animals’ interests is endorsed, it can be understood how animals’ interests may be violated by multicultural policies. Assume that animals have three kinds of interests. First, they have the interest in not having gross suffering inflicted upon them (Casal, 2003; Cochrane, 2007). Second, non-human sentient animals have an interest in some degree of negative freedom: they have an interest in not being physically restricted in cages or forced to undertake hard labor. Third, non-human sentient animals have an interest in having access to resources for their well-being; in particular, non-human sentient animals have an interest in receiving veterinary care and in not being malnourished or denied food. With this modest assumption that animals have an interest in not being treated with cruelty and instead wish to pursue a healthy life, some philosophers have contended that animals’ interests are at risk when giving special rights to groups. There are cultural groups which have practices that interfere with the interests of non-human sentient animals and in terms of multiculturalism these policies may give cultural groups powers that may facilitate animal cruelty. Some cultural groups engage in particular animal slaughtering practices because their religion imposes that meat is cut in a specific way before it is eaten. An example of how multicultural policies can be damaging for non-human sentient animals is if the exemption of minority groups from state laws on animal cruelty could lead to the facilitation of inflicting these harmful practices on animals. In particular, if those groups who practice certain types of animal slaughtering are exempt from animal cruelty laws, then this may facilitate the violation of animals’ interests in not having gross suffering inflicted upon them.

This topic raises also a problem of legitimacy. Most majority societies fail to treat animals with respect and do not usually protect the interests of non-human sentient animals. As a result, a philosophical question that may arise is whether intervention in the practices of minorities mistreat non-human sentient animals would be legitimate, given the fact that majorities themselves fail to treat animals with respect.

5. References and Further Reading

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  • European Union Agency for Fundamental Rights (2009). Homophobia and discrimination on grounds of sexual orientation and gender identity in the EU member states: part ii - the social situation.
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  • Horton, J. (2003). Liberalism and multiculturalism: once more unto the breach. In B. Haddock, and P. Sutch, (Eds). Multiculturalism, identity, and rights. Routledge innovations in political theory. London and New York: Routledge, pp. 25-41.
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  • Kukathas, C. (2003a). Responsibility for past injustice: how to shift the burden. Politics, Philosophy & Economics, 2(2), 165-190.
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  • Kymlicka, W. (1999a). Comments on Shachar and Spinner-Halev: an update from the multiculturalism wars. In C. Joppke, and S. Lukes, (Eds). Multicultural questions. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 112-132.
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  • Okin, S. M. (1999b). Reply. In J. Cohen, M. Howard, and M. C. Nussbaum, (Eds). Is multiculturalism bad for women? Princeton: Princeton University Press, pp. 115-132.
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Author Information

Luís Cordeiro Rodrigues
University of York
United Kingdom

Friedrich Nietzsche: Philosophy of History

NietzscheNietzsche was well-steeped in his contemporary methods and debates in the philosophy of history, which carried over into his philosophy in essential ways. Once a prodigy in classical philology, Nietzsche’s philosophy is everywhere concerned with traditions, historical shifts in custom and meaning, and, to adapt his key expression, "how things become what they are". Beyond these, Nietzsche was closely concerned with the manner these traditions are recorded, emphasized or covered over, as accords the subjective dynamic of those who would claim to know and re-present the past. His earliest philosophical books are marked by an attempt to incorporate Schopenhauer’s notion of timeless ideas into Jakob Burckhardt’s language of historiographical typology. His middle and mature works offer important critiques of both sides of the 19th Century ‘history wars’. Against the Hegelians, Nietzsche rejects efforts to systemize history within rational frameworks as well as teleological schemes generally. Against the ‘Berlin School’ of scientific historiography, he rejects the possibility of subject-free objectivity, realist description, and deductive explanations as to why things happened as they did. In his later thinking, Nietzsche devises his own genealogical mode of writing about the past in response to evolutionary accounts of the development of morals.

This article will trace the context and evolution of Nietzsche’s philosophy of history throughout his career. Attention will be paid, too, to its reception by thinkers in the twentieth and twenty-first centuries.

Table of Contents

  1. Schulpforta
  2. Bonn and Leipzig
  3. Basel
  4. Physiognomy and Teleology
  5. Réealism and Genealogy
  6. Reception
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. References
    2. Further Reading

1. Schulpforta

Nietzsche enrolled at Schulpforta in 1858 at the age of fourteen. The four hundred year-old school was long the standard of humane education in Germany. During Nietzsche’s time there, the character of the school mirrored that of its most venerable literary scholar and historian Friedrich August Koberstein. Embracing those same two disciplines himself, Nietzsche’s first extensive historiographical project covered the saga of the fourth century Ostrogoth King Ermanarich (KGW I/2, 274-284). Even then Nietzsche tried his hand at various historiographic expressions. In 1861, he wrote a symphonic poem entitled Serbia (BAW 2, 32-37). The following year, he presented to his friends Wilhelm Pinder and Gustav Krug three additional “Hungarian Sketches” in imitation of Liszt, whose daughter Cosima was to become Cosima van Bulow and then Cosima Wagner. In the fall of that year, Nietzsche outlined the composition of a dramatic production entitled ‘Ermanarich’ (BAW 2, 144-54), and as late as the summer of 1865, he was considering the performance of an Ermanarich, Oper in drei Akten (BAW 3, 123-4).

Nietzsche’s problem, foremost, is one of conflicting historical sources. Ermanarich, king of Oium in the early 300’s, had been confused over time with various old tribal kings of gothic Germany, like Hermenrich and Emelrich, and the old Danish tribal leader Jarmarich of whom Saxo Grammaticus spoke (BAW 2, 306). His name is Eormenric in the English epic Beowulf and Jörmunrekkr in old Norse songs. His story had been manipulated most egregiously by the chroniclers of the Anglo-Saxons who sought to associate the notoriously cruel and rapacious traits of Attila the Hun with all of their Eastern foes. Whoever Ermanarich actually was, and whatever the factual details of his life and death were, is likely unrecoverable given the discontinuity of the extant historical evidence. But Nietzsche did not rest at the level of philological skepticism. In this, as in his earliest published articles on Theognis and Diogenes Laertius, he constructed a speculative character portrait intended to fill in the missing pieces of the historical story. Such a two-phase meta-historical standpoint—a skeptical realism about the historical sources combined with a psychological constructivism—was indeed cultivated by the instructors at Schulpforta. As Nietzsche’s close friend Karl von Gersdorff would later recall, “[Kobertsein] was pleased in the highest and full of praise for the erudition, the perspicacity, the deductive character and stylistic elegance of his student” (Janz 1993, I 96).

From his work at Schulpforta one can at least begin to outline Nietzsche’s historiographical education in contradistinction to other reigning views. In contrast to Enlightenment historiographers like Voltaire or Gibbon, the young Nietzsche never valorizes his historical figures to make them stand as moral exemplars for our own edification in humanistic ideals. None of the personalities he constructs are enlightened models of rational clarity; each evoke much darker and more earthly psychological compulsions. Nietzsche’s early philological scholarship is in this way more reminiscent of romantic historiography, a likely mark of Koberstein’s influence. Along with Carlyle, Michelet, Schiller, Goethe, and Macaulay, the young Nietzsche conceived the constructive task of the historian as that of a dramaturge who imbues his characters with personality in order to re-enliven formerly lifeless aspects of the past. In the 1850’s and 60’s, the meta-historical theory simultaneously most popular among philosophers and most tendentious among historians was doubtless that put forward by the Hegelian-Marxists. It is apparent that Nietzsche’s Ermanarich project—or for that matter any of his published philology—does not bear even the slightest resemblance to a teleological account, whether idealist or materialist. Ermanarich is not some moment in the march of history, nor some typological phenomenon characteristic of an epoch. Indeed, the conservative religious and constitutionalist leanings of Schulpforta would hardly have been conducive to the Hegelian-Marxist way of thinking.

2. Bonn and Leipzig

Friedrich August Wolf is typically considered the father of German philology. Wolf provided the study of antiquity, more than a generation before Ranke did for historiography generally, its first systematic set of methods and its first aspiration to achieve the same sort of demonstrable progress and rigor as the natural sciences. Wolf’s two most important descendants, Gottfried Hermann and August Boeckh, founded two groups of scholars with antipodal methodologies: the Sprachphilologen and the Sachphilologen respectively. For the former, the scientific status of philology entailed both certainty and objectivity, which in turn meant avoiding as much as possible the intrusion of subjective interpretations of evidence.  To do that, the Sprachphilologen narrowed their net of acceptable evidence to that which allegedly needed no interpretation, to that form of evidence whose meaning would allegedly be manifest to whoever could observe it: the written word. The Sachphilologen, on the contrary, considered science as a means of circumscribing the whole of experience. That whole, with respect to antiquity, could be elucidated in part through written accounts, to be sure, but only in part. What counted equally as evidence were the artifacts of antiquity: the plastic arts, the architecture, the coinage, even the clothing, athletics, tools, and playthings. None of these phenomena speaks for itself in the way the written word does. Each requires the understanding of the historian to reconstruct what their meaning might have been—each historical phenomenon, in other words, is meaningful only within a scheme of hermeneutical interpretation. Something of the objectivity and exactitude is lost therein; but the sacrifice is repaid by attaining a more comprehensive sense of antiquity through the totality of its artifacts.

The overwhelming portion of training Nietzsche received in the methods of professional historiography was philological. But in place of a single unitary lesson, Nietzsche found himself immersed directly in a debate about the meaning of the field itself during his education at both Bonn and Leipzig. His teacher Friedrich Ritschl was the student of Hermann and of Hermann’s student Karl Christian Reisig. Otto Jahn, like Nietzsche a Schulpforta graduate, went on to study with Hermann in Leipzig and Lachmann in Berlin. But Jahn was also a student of Boeckh at Berlin, and was considered alongside his friend Theodor Mommsen one of the defenders of Sachphilologie.

Ritschl’s pedagogy mimicked Wolf’s in its holistic approach to shaping not just scholars but men. Yet in his scholarship, he was clearly an adherent of the rigor and discipline of Hermann’s Sprachphilologie. Jahn was equally scientific in terms of rigor. But in keeping with Sachphilologie, he ventured beyond the written word and investigated the wholeness of culture, especially by applying philological methodology to the objects of archeology. In the school year of 1864-5, the same year that Nietzsche entered Bonn, Ritschl and Jahn engaged in a petty yet field-altering squabble that came to be known as the Bonnerstreit. Although Nietzsche took Jahn’s side in the matter—as he wrote to Gersdorff, “Here in Bonn the biggest flap, the worst cattiness about the Jahn-Ritschlstreit still dominates. I consider Jahn unconditionally right” (an Gersdorff 25.5.1865, KSB 2, 56)—he nevertheless had no palpable interest in Jahn’s archeological, artistic, or numismatical studies. His philological articles in those years on Theognis and Diogenes Laertius show a methodological allegiance to Ritschl’s Sprachphilologie, and retain the basic strategy of his earlier effort on Ermanarich in that they rely both on a skeptical realism about the authenticity of the texts and the construction of a Charakterbild in order to supply the psychological motivations for the agents’ behaviors in the historical stories. Both of Nietzsche’s projects were lauded by Ritschl, who transferred to the University of Leipzig, and indeed both were published in his still-active journal, Rheinisches Museum für Philologie. On their merits, Nietzsche famously graduated from Leipzig without a formal dissertation and was given appointment at the University of Basel as a replacement for another of Ritschl’s students, Adolf Kiessling.

3. Basel

In 1869, Nietzsche presented the lecture “Homer und die klassische Philologie” (KGW II/1, 247-69), full of hope for the potential of a renewed and invigorated field. Toward the end of the lecture, however, he declares that that goal must be accomplished by recognizing a new philosophical basis, that “each and every philological activity should be enclosed by and proceed from a philosophical worldview” (KGW II/1, 268). The reference is clearly to Schopenhauer, whom he had begun to read already in the Fall of 1865. Nietzsche and most of his associates at the time sought to combine Schopenhauer’s teaching with historiography. His childhood friend Paul Deussen studied oriental history and culture with Swami Vivekananda—and would found the Schopenahuer-Gesellschaft in 1911. Richard Wagner, who fancied himself at times the reviver of the ‘true’ historical Germanic culture, sent a personal copy of his Nibelungen directly to Schopenhauer, and sometimes touted that his opera was the expression of Schopenhauer's aesthetics. Erwin Rohde, himself the author of what remains one of the finest scholarly books on Ancient mystery cults and ‘Dionysian’ culture, Psyche: Seelencult und Unsterblichkeitsglaube der Griechen (1890-4), was a lifelong Schopenhauerian. Johann Jacob Bachofen’s psychology of the dark anti-rational undercurrents of ancient history in his Das Mutterrecht (1861) and his critique of scientific ‘objectivity’ both intimate Schopenhauerian influence. And although he is sometimes thought to be anti-philosophical, Jakob Burckhardt was an overt Schopenhauerian—as well as the most renowned cultural historian of his generation.

Nietzsche and Burckhardt had similar upbringings insofar as their introductions to the critical methods of philology extinguished the flame of their devotion to Christianity. Like Burckhardt, too, Nietzsche came to view the obsessive source criticism of Sprachphilologie as a necessary correction of romantic historiography, but also as a potentially detrimental step in the development of an individual scholar and, eventually, in the development of culture. The concern for both at this time is not to report the past with an unattainable degree of objectivity, “wie es eigentlich gewesen ist,” as Burckhardt’s teacher Leopold von Ranke demanded. Rather, “a single source happily chosen can,” for Burckhardt, “do duty for a whole multitude of possible other sources, since he who is really determined to learn, that is, to become rich in spirit, can by a simple unction of his mind, discern and feel the general in the particular” (Burckhardt 1930-4, VII 15). Burckhardt sought to intuit that which was constant, universal, and typical from the welter of particular passing forms. Like Schopenhauer, who himself—despite a massive historical erudition and a cordial acquaintance with Wolf—had almost nothing positive to say about historiography, Burckhardt believed that only the timeless and universal could rise to the level of truth, hence his and Nietzsche’s focus on Kulturgeschichte rather than the passing intrigues of political history. Furthermore, like Nietzsche (at least in these years), but in contradistinction to Schopenhauer, Burckhardt believed that the proper study of history could reveal precisely that: typological traits within people, forms of personalities, and characteristics of epochs. As Burckhardt writes, “Our point of departure is the one and the only thing which lasts in history and is its only possible center: man, this suffering, striving and active being, as he is and was and will forever be” (Burckhardt 1930-4, VII, 3). Indeed, as Nietzsche echoes in his preface to his Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks (1873), “I am going to emphasize only that point of each of their systems which constitutes a piece of character and hence belongs to that non-controvertible, non-discussable evidence which it is the task of history to preserve: […]” (PtG, P; KSA 1, 801f). For both Burckhardt and Nietzsche, what was most worthy of being taken up by history was never the common or mundane person, but the ‘great man’. For Burckhardt this mainly meant the leading figures of Renaissance Italy, while for Nietzsche, Pre-Socratic Greeks appeared like giants calling to each other in the spirit of competition from atop high mountain peaks.

However true to the philosophy of Schopenhauer Burckhardt styled himself, his conception of the historian’s ability to intuit common formal patterns within the myriad variegations of historical personages was closer to Goethe’s morphology than to Schopenhauer’s aesthetische Anschauung (Gay 1974, 178f). For Goethe, the close observation of the biological development of organic objects, as much as the composition of the dramatic development of a literary character, would reveal Urphänomene or the primary forms of the phenomenon which guided their development. In his dramatic works, Goethe sought to portray the Steigerung of typological characters like Werther, Tasso, or Goetz, whose development over time is not the alteration or transformation of character but its intensification over time. Burckhardt thought the historian’s task was similar insofar as the careful study of historical documents would reveal typological traits among great people, the course of whose development only intensified what was necessarily there from the start.

For Schopenhauer, by contrast, aesthetic intuition was never about discovering typical recurrences in history or a developmental intensification, but gazing beyond the ‘veil of Maya’ in a partial break from the spatio-temporal forms of subjective willing. Aesthetic intuition for Schopenhauer was a non-intellectual and thus non-discursive Auffassung of the Ideas which constitute the first objectification of the one panenthetic Will (that is, the will of a God who is everywhere and in everything). Aesthetic apprehension can only occur when these instrumental satisfactions in the here and now have been removed entirely, when the will of the spectator is silenced. In contrast to art, historiography was merely like science insofar as it only ever studied its objects subjectively, that is, insofar as they might satisfy the demands of the individuated will (Schopenhauer 1977, X/2 459f). Just as the sciences study their objects in order to use them, benefit from them, or solve problems with them, historians only research the topics they do with an eye toward explaining what was previously unknown, solving mysteries, or perhaps toward finding insights to contemporary problems. Indeed, precisely because of the subjective and necessarily temporal judgments of history, Schopenhauer, in opposition to both Burckhardt and Nietzsche at this time, esteemed history insufficient to attain the “deep truths” of the world in the manner of great art. “Wherever it is a question of knowledge of cause and effect or of grounds and consequences of any kind,” writes Schopenhauer, “that is to say in all branches of natural science and mathematics, as also in history, or with inventions, etc., the knowledge sought must be an aim of the will” (Schopenhauer 1977, X/2, 459f). Burckhardt and Nietzsche both thought that history failed to attain the level of science, but for different reasons. Unlike science, history is unable to construct laws by which the historian might predict future cases, and, more importantly, should not try to be scientific since its proper aim was not understanding but creating values. But although Burckhardt had nothing to do with the mystical elements of Schopenhauer’s thought, his younger Basel colleague was less concerned with scholarly restraint.

To Burckhardt’s and Ritschl’s consternation, Nietzsche tried to co-opt the Schopenhauerian aesthetic-metaphysical mysticism in his first ‘historical’ work, The Birth of Tragedy (1872). “But our Nietzsche!” Ritschl would write to Wilhelm Vischer, the man who a few years before hired Nietzsche at Basel, “It’s remarkable how in one person two souls live next to each other. On the one side, the strictest method of academic scientific research…on the other this fantastically-overreaching, over enthusiastic, beat-you-senseless, Wagnerian-Schopenhauerian art-mystery-religion-crap [Kunstmysterienreligionsschwärmerei]! […] What really makes me mad is his impiety against his true mother, who had suckled him at her breast: philology” (KSA 15, 46f). The justification for Nietzsche’s claims about the ‘inner’ or ‘real’ nature of tragedy was never intended to have utilized the same methodology as his earlier philology, no longer aiming at a correspondence between the account and what the evidence portrays to be real, as Ritschl sensed easily enough. In claiming that the real origin of tragedy is a happy confluence of Dionysian and Apolline drives at a particular moment in history, Nietzsche instead makes an intuitional claim that transgresses the boundaries of naturalistic explanation. Nietzsche, as Jahn’s student Ulrich von Wilamowitz Moellendorff famously charged, shunned source criticism, neglected linguistic analysis, couldn’t be bothered to footnote, was generally ignorant of archeology, and “revile[d] the historical-critical method, denouncing any intuition which deviates from his own, and [ascribed] a ‘complete misunderstanding of the study of antiquity’ to the age in which philology in Germany, due to Gottfried Hermann and Karl Lachmann was raised to an unprecedented height” (Wilamowitz-Moellendorff 1872, 5). Beyond traditional historical versions of intuition in the manner of Herder or Burckhardt, Nietzsche’s believes his own intuitions about tragedy are true precisely insofar as he has left the phenomenal realm behind and become identified with the inner nature of the tragic world in-itself. Through a sort of mystical echo of the ancient standard of truth as identity between the subject and object, the principle that “like is known by like,” Nietzsche thinks he can communicate the real inner Idea of tragedy:

Only insofar as the genius, during the act of artistic procreation, merges fully with that original artist of the world does he know anything of the eternal essence of art; for in this condition he resembles, miraculously, that uncanny image of fairy-tale which can turn its eyes around and look at itself; now he is at one and the same time subject and object, simultaneously poet, actor, and spectator. (BT 5, KSA 1, 47f.)

Like Wagner, who in his own aesthetic ecstasy was claimed by Nietzsche to have attained a “sort of omniscience [Allwissenheit] … as if the visual power of his eyes hovered not only upon surfaces, but ‘ins Innere’” (BT 22, KSA 1, 140), Nietzsche believed himself to inhabit the sort of aesthetic state of Schopenhauer’s genius. “I had discovered the only historical simile and facsimile of my own innermost experience,—and this led me to apprehend the amazing phenomenon of the Dionysian…” (EH 'Geburt' 2, KSA 6, 311). Another retrospective evaluation claims the work was, “Constructed entirely from precocious, wet-behind-the-ears personal experiences, all of which lay at the very threshold of what could be communicated.” This was apparently because the work was not scientific-philology but was, “located in the territory of art […] perhaps a book for artists with some subsidiary capacity for analysis and retrospection (in other words, for an exceptional type of artist […]), full of psychological innovations and artist-mysteries, with an artist’s metaphysics in the background…” (BT 'Versuch' 2, KSA 1, 13).

4. Physiognomy and Teleology

Shortly before the Birth of Tragedy, Nietzsche wrote to Erwin Rohde that “Scholarship, art, and philosophy are growing together inside me to such an extent that one day I’m bound to give birth to centaurs” (Letter to Rohde, January 15th, 1870; KSB 3, 95). Indeed, the book was just that, though it was no longer something to be proud of. Almost immediately after, Nietzsche rescinded his artistic-mystical view about the historian’s ability to intuit the real Ideas, in Schopenhauer’s technical sense, of the nature of tragedy beyond the mediated observation of the past through historical evidence. “For the readers of my earlier writings I wish to expressly clarify that I have abandoned the metaphysical-artistic views that fundamentally govern them” (N Ende 1876-Sommer 1877 23[159], KSA 8, 463). His increasingly skeptical attitude toward the mystical aspect of Schopenhauer’s philosophy led Nietzsche to revise major aspects of his own thought.

In 1874’s vom Nutzen und Nachteil der Historie für das Leben, Nietzsche presents three ‘types’ of historian, the critical, antiquarian, and monumental. None of these “merges with the original artist of the world”; none becomes the “subject and object” of their historical study. Instead, each type of historian represents the past according to the rules of an inner necessity, exaggerating or downplaying certain aspects of the past in order to tear down idols, preserve them, or build them up. Each type of historian and their accordant way of representing the past has its advantages and disadvantages for themselves and for the cultures in which they live, but none is able to represent the past as it ‘really’ was since into each of their judgments intrudes their psychologically-determined desires and interests.

If it is, as Nietzsche begins to think, that all judgments are constituted by unconscious psychological dynamics, then the ‘subject-free’ ideal of objectivity must be jettisoned. Certainly, the Schopenhauerian aesthetic escape from individual subjectivity will be impossible; but so will the Rankean ‘disinterested’ vision of scientific objectivity. The best one can hope for historians, Nietzsche thinks, is that the subjective facticities that distort their judgments would be in some sense ‘healthy’, or at least healthier than those judgments that infect modern schoolbooks. Only the strong have the right sort of subjective dynamics that would enable a healthy interpretation of historical events. “If you are to venture to interpret the past you can do so only out of the fullest exertion of the vigor of the present: only when you put forth your noblest qualities in all their strength will you divine what is worth knowing and preserving in the past. Like to like! Otherwise, you will draw the past down to you. Do not believe historiography that does not spring from the head of the rarest minds…” (UB II 6, KSA 1, 293f).

By looking at the psychological conditions within which historians construct their accounts, Nietzsche effectively focuses the ‘historical sense’—“the capacity for quickly guessing the order of rank of the valuations according to which a people, a society, a human being has lived” (BGE 224, KSA 5, 157)—on the historians themselves. “History belongs above all to the active and powerful man,” Nietzsche proclaims—like Schiller or Goethe who view the past as a model for inspiration, not merely to imitate, but as an “incentive to do as others have done and do it better” (UB II, 2,  KSA 1, 259). Among those with highly-ranked drives Nietzsche declares Burckhardt (see among many examples, N Frühling-Sommer 1875 5[58], KSA 8, 56), Thucydides (e.g., GD Antike 2, KSA 6, 155f), Hekataeus (KGW II/5, 229f), Tacitus (N 1885 43[3], KSA 11, 702), Hippolyte Taine (JGB 254, KSA 5, 198), and Ritschl (EH 'klug' 9, KSA 6, 295). Among those badly ranked are Karl Lachmann (N März 1875 3[36], KSA 8, 24), the historian of ancient philosophy Eduard Zeller (KGB II/1, 124), and Overbeck’s confidant Heinrich von Treitschke (EH 'Wagner' 3, KSA 6, 361). Relegated to a secondary consideration is whether these historians’ ‘facts’ are accurate; what is time and again foregrounded is the order of rank of the values and drives according to which their historiographical accounts are constructed.

The same is true of Nietzsche’s evaluation of teleological historiography. Although David Friedrich Strauss (see the entirety of UB I, KSA 1, 159-242) and Hegel (see N Frühling-Sommer 1875 5[58], KSA 8, 57) are also targets, much of what Nietzsche says in the latter chapters of Nutzen und Nachteil about teleological historiography is directed against Eduard von Hartmann (see also N 1884 26[326], KSA 11, 236; N November 1887-März 1888 11[61], KSA 13, 30). Hartmann’s philosophical history of consciousness was largely a synthesis of Schopenhauer’s depiction of the blind world will and Hegel’s teleological unfolding of both mind and the rational course of history itself (Hartmann 1923, I 329). Spiritual and moral progress are guaranteed by the Divine Will, whose ideas are instantiated first within the unconscious desires and drives of early peoples and then in an ever-increasing degree of conscious reflection within civilized nations. The aims of the Divine Will are accomplished, consciously or otherwise, regardless of whatever individuals would like to make of their futures.

Hartmann and the sort of Hegelian teleological historicism he represents have, of course, gone out of fashion. It would be rather absurd in today’s more naturalistic historiographical climate to try to prove that a particular decision by a particular agent was the effect of the Divine Will’s cosmic plan; but the focus of Nietzsche’s critique lay elsewhere. In keeping with his view that judgments are necessarily a function of the psychological fundament of their authors, Nietzsche targets the underlying motivations that would lead Hartmann, and for that matter Hegel, to interpret the historical world as teleological in the first place. What he discovers in these teleological historians is a ‘cynical’ outlook on life generally. Instead of a grim determination to affirm their lives they surrender themselves to the recognition that nothing they do is anything more than a preordained stepping-stone on the march toward the absolute. Teleological historians are driven by a nihilistic desire, by the need, Nietzsche contends, to absolve their own wills: “die volle Hingabe der Persönlichkeit an den Weltprozess” [the total sacrifice of individuality to the world-process] (UB II 9, KSA 1, 316). This surrender of today for the sake of some promised future ideal is a secularized version, Nietzsche ultimately thinks, of the Christian faith in heaven.

Although positivism and teleology are nearly antonyms today, this was not the case in Nietzsche’s century. Comte, and his sociological and economical descendants such as Durkheim and Marx, each envisioned an epochal and progressive scheme of history—a sort of one-way street from a repressed past to an enlightened future. Both, however, were careful to replace Hegel and Hartmann’s extra-natural teleological movers in history with a positivist or materialist theory of explanation respectively. In doing so, they considered their developmental schemes both equally demonstrable and as necessary as those of the natural sciences. “All historical writing,” Marx tells us, “must set out from these natural bases and their modification in the course of history through the action of men” (Marx & Engels 1845, 36). “Scientific history, or sociology,” according to Durkheim, “must be founded upon the direct observation of concrete facts” (Durkheim 1972, 78). Such scientific historical representations rested on their shared hope of ascribing causes that governed the behaviors of either individuals or groups as they undergo their progressive development, and that hope can be traced back to H.T. Buckle, the original ‘scientific historian’, whom Nietzsche himself recognizes in this context (See GM I 4, KSA 5, 262).

Nietzsche rejected grand architectonics whose purpose seemed only to convince people that they will someday soon be better off. He also criticized the efforts to regard the past as unfolding even to non-teleological laws insofar as their effort to deduce nomothetically betrayed either their desire to predict and thereby control future events or else their fear of the unknown. “In other disciplines, generalizations [Allgemeinheiten] are the most important thing since they contain the laws [Gesetze]. But if such assertions as that cited are meant to be valid laws, then we could reply that the historian’s work is wasted. For whatever truth is left in such statements, after subtracting that mysterious and irreducible residue we mentioned earlier, is obvious and even trivial since it is self-evident to anyone with the slightest range of experience” (UB II 6, KSA 1, 291f). While there may have been a certain admiration for positivism’s rigorous and anti-metaphysical methodologies, Nietzsche says very little about any of these proto-sociologists. Most notoriously, Nietzsche never names Marx a single time anywhere in his writing.

5. Réealism and Genealogy

Nietzsche’s rejection of nomothetic schemata that purport to explain historical change, whether metaphysical or naturalistic, does not imply he was a radical outlier of the ‘historical’ 19th-Century. Every bit as historically-concerned as the teleologists, he thinks “philosophy, or that alone which I count it to be, [is] the most general form of history, the attempt to somehow describe and abbreviate in signs the Heraclitean world of becoming…” (N 1885 36[27], KSA 11, 562). Nietzsche’s attempt at historicizing philosophy would endure longer than his friendship with the man who helped to inspire it. For alongside Paul Rée he came to the conviction that values, whether moral, political, aesthetic, or even metaphysical, were a function of drives which were themselves conditioned subconsciously throughout a long historical process. Old religious and Platonic beliefs in good and evil as static metaphysical entities were, for both Rée and Nietzsche, to be replaced with a naturalistic and developmental account about how present-day values derive from a convoluted process of practical and often egoistical considerations. But where for Rée, like Darwin and Lamarck before him, acquired habits become inherited traits due to their role in helping both individuals and societies survive better relative to their competitors, Nietzsche viewed the historical inculcation of moral sentiments as a reflection of group attempts to instantiate power-aims.

In keeping with his exhortation that philosophy become historical, Nietzsche variously endeavors to construct a ‘history of the moral sensations’, a ‘natural history of morals’, and most famously, a Genealogy of Morals (1887), a book whose mission is derived from a deeply historicist conviction. “[W]e need to know about the conditions and circumstances under which the values grew up, developed, and changed…” (GM P 6, KSA 5, 253). To that end, Nietzsche would seem to require a set of demonstrable historical premises: that there really was a time during which a masterly set of values dominated and a later time at which it became displaced by the widely-flung inversion of those values known as slave morality. Indeed he claims to seek, “morality as it really existed and was really lived,” “the real history of morality,” which can “actually be confirmed and has actually existed” (GM P 7, KSA 5, 254).

But doing so enmeshes Nietzsche in considerable meta-historical problems, some of which he himself poses. The Genealogie is above all an attempt to articulate the history of the development of moral values in a way that undermines his contemporaries’ faith in the absoluteness of their own values. It does so on two levels: first by offering an historical explanation that reveals the intrinsically historical rather than absolute character of moral values. Nietzsche had formidable allies on this score in Rée and the ‘English School’ of moral psychology—represented foremost by Herbert Spencer—both of whom followed Charles Darwin’s intimation that even morality should be viewed as an evolutionary phenomenon. But whereas their interpretation of that evolution seemed to guarantee the progressive status of fundamentally Christian values like altruism, honesty, cooperation, and compassion, Nietzsche’s own psychologizing-historiography uncovered a darker underside of morality. In fact, as has been thoroughly argued, the text itself represents something like a new-Darwinism (Richardson 2004) or anti-Darwinism (Johnson 2010), insofar as it rejects evolutionary progress and substitutes a vision of the ‘competition of wills’ as a mechanism to explain historical change. Nietzsche rejects the Darwinian accounts by dismantling their presumptions about the origin of value resting with the recipient rather than the doer of ‘good’ or ‘bad’ deeds, about nature aiming at preservation rather than overcoming, about the passivity and accidental character of propagatory success, and about the possibility and value of altruism within social frameworks. The success of this refutation rests in its being somehow a ‘better’ historical account than social-Darwinian alternative, that is, a more accurate and comprehensive historical account than theirs. Given that Nietzsche offers scant historical data that would support his own interpretation of events—the few proffered etymologies would hardly prove much—his account, as an objective history of morality largely fails to demonstrate Nietzsche’s counter-hypotheses.

It is on the second level, a meta-historical level, that Nietzsche’s Genealogie proves its enduring originality. Nietzsche shows that the very attempt to reconstruct the story of development of morality “as it really happened” is occluded by the recognition that the narrator of events is intrinsic to the story, that the historian himself is no will-less, objective, static point of observation, but was himself a perpetually becoming, value-laden dynamic of subjectivity, who is every bit as historical and drive-constituted as the values he was trying to explain. Contrary to Darwinians of any stripe, Nietzsche recognized that historiography is never about ‘getting the facts straight’, ‘wie es eigentlich gewesen ist’, but about interpreting it according to the drive-informed perspective in which the historian was embedded. Whereas the Darwinians interpreted the historical evolution of morality as if they themselves stood outside of it, for Nietzsche, “[W]e count—after the fact—all the twelve trembling strokes of the clock of our experience, our lives, our being—alas! In the process we keep losing the count. So we remain necessarily strangers to ourselves, we do not understand ourselves, we have to keep ourselves confused” (GM P 1, KSA 5, 247). Values and also that conception of ourselves as the architects of values dynamically affects the way by which one interprets those values, such that the attempt to re-present the ‘first bell’, that original value, free of the distortions of generations of overwriting, reformulating, and above all re-valuing those values, becomes impossible.

How have the moral genealogists reacted so far in this matter? Naively, as is their wont: they highlight some ‘purpose’ in punishment, for example, revenge or deterrence, then innocently place the purpose at the start, as causa fiendi of punishment, and—have finished. But ‘purpose in law’ is the last thing we should apply to the history of the emergence of law: on the contrary, there is no more important proposition for every sort of history than that which we arrive at only with great effort but which we really should reach,—namely that the origin of the emergence of a thing and its ultimate usefulness, its practical application and incorporation into a system of ends, are toto coelo separate; that anything in existence, having somehow come about, is continually interpreted anew, requisitioned anew, transformed and redirected to a new purpose by a power superior to it; that everything that occurs in the organic world consists of overpowering, dominating, and in their turn, overpowering and dominating consist of re-interpretation, adjustment, in the process of which their former ‘meaning’ and ‘purpose’ must necessarily be obscured or completely obliterated. [...] But every purpose and use is just a sign that the will to power has achieved mastery over something less powerful, and has impressed upon it its own meaning of a use function; and the whole history of a ‘thing’, an organ, a tradition can to this extent be a continuous chain of signs, continually revealing new interpretations and adaptations, the causes of which need not be connected even amongst themselves, but rather sometimes just follow and replace one another at random. (GM II, 12; KSA 5, 312)

As this passage offers the most expansive explication of his mature historical theory, it is worth careful investigation. There seem to be three interrelated theses here. First, history practiced rightly must accord the genuine nature of reality. Other ‘genealogists’, who in this context are represented primarily by Nietzsche’s one-time friend Paul Rée and the Darwin-inspired moralists such as Herbert Spencer, are in a better position than ahistorical philosophers such as Plato and Spinoza insofar as they rightly recognize the fluidity of moral concepts. However, where the naively realist genealogists go wrong is in unreflectively presuming that their own interpretations of those moral concepts are somehow true for all time and all people, in other words, that their interpretations of the flow of history somehow stand outside the flow of history (see also Johnson 2010, 116-148; Born 2010, 202-52).

Second, Nietzsche’s mature genealogy adapts what might be called an anti-realist theory of historical explanation and description. Terms like ‘cause’, ‘effect’, and ‘purpose’ are not elements of a ‘real’ world, but signs that have been found useful for communicating meaning intersubjectively. Descriptions like ‘terrorist’, ‘revolution’, and ‘democracy’ identify in language what is actually a non-identical set of loosely-connected phenomena.

Third, and as a consequence of the first two theses, there can be no single ‘absolute’ interpretation of the past. Interpretations are a function of the historical world. Like all phenomena, they change and transmogrify over time in accordance to the deep and often unconscious demands of the agents who construct, accept, or reject those interpretations. The example of punishment in this passage illustrates particularly well how the meaning of a single word shifts over epochs and cultures. What accounts for that shift is the fluctuating power dynamics both within particular historians and among the wider sphere of what a culture considers an historical ‘fact’ over time.

Despite his conviction that philosophy must be historical, then, Nietzsche simultaneously understood writing philosophy historically to be a deeply problematic endeavor. Any attempt to describe or explain a historical event amounts to an illegitimate de-contextualization, an attempt to affix the unaffixable with allegedly static concepts. As he would write to his friend, the historical theologian Franz Overbeck, “At last my mistrust now turns to the question whether history is actually possible? What, then does one want to ascertain [feststellen]?—something, which in a moment of happening, does not itself ‘stand fast’ [‘feststand’]?” (an Overbeck 23.02.1887, KSB 8, 28). The situation is made worse in recognizing that not only is the reality to be described in a state of flux, but the one who recognizes it is in a similar state of flux. Not only has Heraclitus’s river changed, so has the subjectivity of the one who has entered it.

A similar cluster of problems was faced by Neo-Kantian thinkers in the years just following Nietzsche’s Genealogie. Wilhelm Windelband, Heinrich Rickert, and the quasi-Neo-Kantian Wilhelm Dilthey were each keen in their own ways to view historical judgment as a function of subjective facticities rather than as a mirror of an objective past. Each sought, like Nietzsche, to distinguish history from science both in terms of the methodology of its investigations and the sorts of objects it studies. Where science seeks to explain by deduction from general rules, history only contains such generalities in imprecise abstractions. Due to the singularity of every object under its purview, history cannot hope to explain scientifically by means of deduction under general laws. As Windelband phrases it in his inaugural address as rector at Strasbourg, “The nomological sciences are concerned with what is invariably the case. The sciences of process are concerned with what once was the case” (Windelband 1894, 175). The former sciences were famously designated nomothetic, the latter, like historiography, called idiographic. Finally, while historiography does involve the search for explanations in terms of causes, those causes must be regarded as value-imbued. “History,” Rickert writes, “with its individualizing method and its orientation to values, has to investigate the causal relations subsisting among the unique and individual events with which it is concerned. These causal relations do not coincide with any universal laws of nature…the selection of what is essential in history involves reference to values even in the inquiry into causes…” (Rickert 1889, 94; see also Windelband 1884, 205). In place of a universal dogmatic positivist explanation, philosophers of history following the neo-Kantians address which causal account best satisfies the subjective standards of the historians and of their audience. Compare this to Nietzsche’s claim in Ecce Homo, that “we are not looking for just any type of explanatory cause, we are looking for a chosen, preferred type of explanation, one that will most quickly and reliably get rid of the feeling of unfamiliarity and novelty, the feeling that we are dealing with something we have never encountered before,—the most common explanation” (GD Irrthümer 5, KSA 6.93).

6. Reception

Nietzsche rejects attempts to construe a past in-itself without acknowledging the tangled but inextricable web of interpretations cast upon it by later interpreters. “[T]he origin of the emergence of a thing and its ultimate usefulness, its practical application and incorporation into a system of ends, are toto coelo separate; anything in existence, having somehow come about, is continually interpreted anew, requisitioned anew, transformed and redirected to a new purpose” (GM II 12, KSA 5, 313). Any attempt to isolate Nietzsche’s historiographical ideas for the sake of contextualizing them would accordingly demand a reckoning of the many drives of its very many interpreters over the past century or so. Such a genealogical account of Nietzsche’s historiography would be severely unwieldy, if not impossible. It nevertheless serves to mention at least two of the most prominent lines of the interpretive reception of Nietzsche’s meta-history.

Although a broad generalization, continental thinkers from the 1930’s to the 1970’s such as Heidegger, Jaspers, Sartre, Arendt, Levinas, Ricouer and Patočka took their cue from Nietzsche’s demand that the human person be considered within the framework of his or her historicity. Specifically, they each appear influenced by Nietzsche’s 1874 characterization of the human animal as the one unable to ignore his or her temporality; being human means being forever tied to a continual process of becoming, the awareness of which it is our unique burden to bear (UB II 1, KSA 1, 248f). In fact, this single idea is arguably the most essential and unifying theme among all mid-20th Century continental thinkers. One must understand her existential condition as oriented in her birth and propelled toward her future possibilities, which fall under the inescapable common horizon of death. Orienting oneself to one’s history becomes the essential existential project.

Among later postmodern continental thinkers such as Foucault, DeMan, Lacoue-Labarthes, Lyotard, Derrida, and among the most noted contemporary postmodern meta-historians like Hayden White, Frank Ankersmit, and Keith Jenkins, the anthropological focus increasingly shifts to an epistemological one. The view of history as a mirror of the real events of a real objective past is ridiculed as an outdated conservative ideal. Historiography has historically not been used to discover truth, pure and unadulterated—and indeed cannot be. Historical writing hitherto has consisted in a set of authoritative narratives constructed in order to justify existing biases and power structures. Consistent with their interpretation of Nietzsche’s genealogical project, they see the West in a moment of cultural crisis, one which historiography has uncovered and which it must of itself help resolve. Historiography’s task is thus no longer to simply records facts, they hold, but to unmask the so-called ‘objective’ systems of values by deconstructing or revealing as mythic the ideological foundations on which they were built. After those grand-narratives have been exposed, historiography’s myth-making capacities are to be refocused to allow previously underrepresented groups to construct the story from their own perspectives. One senses here the rather freely-interpreted application of Nietzsche’s claim that “the more eyes, different eyes we learn to set upon the same object, the more complete will be our ‘concept’ of this thing, the more ‘objective’” (GM III 12, KSA 5, 365), but they are nevertheless correct to acknowledge the debt their own conception of power-interpretation owes to Nietzsche.

7. References and Further Reading

  • BAW: Historisch-kritische Gesamtausgabe: Werke, 5 vols., edited by Joachim Mette et al. (Berlin, 1933–43).
  • KGB: Kritische Gesamtausgabe: Briefwechsel, edited by Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari (Berlin, 1975ff).
  • KGW: Kritische Gesamtausgabe: Werke, edited by Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari (Berlin, 1967ff).
  • KSA: Sämtliche Werke: Kritische Studienausgabe, 15 vols., edited by Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari (Berlin, 1988).
  • KSB: Sämtliche Briefe: Kritische Studienausgabe, 8 vols., edited by Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari (Berlin, 1986).

a. References

  • Born, Marcus Andreas, Nihilistisches Geschichtsdenken: Nietzsches perspektivische Genealogie (München: Wilhelm Fink, 2010).
  • Burckhardt, Jakob, Gesamtausgabe in 14 Bände, edited by Emil Dürr et al. (Stuttgart/Berlin/Leipzig: Deutsche Verlaganstalt, 1930-4).
  • Durkheim, Émile, Selected Writings, edited by Anthony Giddens (Cambridge (Cambridge University Press, 1972).
  • Gay, Peter, Style in History: Gibbon, Ranke, Macaulay, Burckhardt (New York /London: W.W. Norton, 1974).
  • Hartmann, Eduard von, Philosophie des UnbewusstenSpeculative Resultate nach inductiv-naturwissenschaftlicher Methode in 3 Bände (Leipzig: Kröner, 1923).
  • Janz, Curt Paul, Friedrich Nietzsche. Biographie in drei Bände (Munich: Carl Hanser, 1993).
  • Johnson, Dirk R., Nietzsche’s Anti-Darwinism (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010).
  • Marx, Karl & Engels, Friedrich, The German Ideology, translated by S. Ryazanskaya (New York: Prometheus, 1998).
  • Richardson, John, Nietzsche's New Darwinism (New York/Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2004).
  • Rickert, Heinrich, Science and History: Critique of Positivist Epistemology, translated by G. Reisman (New York: Van Nostrand, 1962).
  • Schopenhauer, Arthur, Zürcher Ausgabe. Werke in zehn Bände, edited by Hübscher et al. (Zürich: Diogenes Verlag, 1977).
  • Wilamowitz-Moellendorff, Ulirch von, “Future Philology! A Reply to Friedrich Nietzsche’s ‘The Birth of Tragedy’,” translated by Gertrude Postl et al., New Nietzsche Studies 4[1] (2000): 1-32.
  • Windelband, William, An Introduction to Philosophy, translated by J. McCabe (London: Unwin, 1921).
  • Windelband, William, “History and Natural Science,” translated by G. Oakes, History and Theory 19[2] (1980): 165-85.

b. Further Reading

  • Bahnsen, Julius, Zur Philosophie der Geschichte: Eine kritische Besprechung des Hegel-Hartmann’sche Evolutionismus aus Schopenhauer’schen Principien (Berlin: Duncker, 1872).
    • One of Nietzsche’s principle sources for both his criticism of teleology and his formulation of a naturalistic theory of historical explanation.
  • Benne, Christian, Nietzsche und die historisch-kritische Philologie (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 2005)
    • Exposits and analyzes the way Nietzsche’s early philological training enters his mature philosophical thinking.
  • Bernoulli, Carl Albrecht, Das Dreigestirn: Bachofen, Jakob Burckhardt, Nietzsche (Basel: Schwabe & Co., 1931).
    • A reliable and comprehensive account of the personal and intellectual interrelations of these three Basel professors.
  • Blondel, Éric, The Body and Culture: Philosophy as Philological Genealogy, translated by Sean Hand (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1991).
    • Highly insightful attempt to assimilate Nietzsche’s philological training with a postmodern account of his perspectivism.
  • Born, Marcus Andreas, Nihilistisches Geschichtsdenken: Nietzsches perspektivische Genealogie (München: Wilhelm Fink, 2010).
    • A Foucault-influenced account of Nietzsche’s critique of Hegelian teleology and the historical ramifications of the death of God.
  • Brobjer, Thomas H. (2004): “Nietzsche’s View of the Value of Historical Studies and Methods” In: Journal of the History of Ideas. Bd. 65 (2), 301-22.
  • Brobjer, Thomas H., “Nietzsche’s Relation to Historical Methods and Nineteenth-Century German Historiography,” History and Theory 46 (2007): 155–79.
    • Both pieces by Brobjer present a wealth of information about Nietzsche’s historiographical context, reading, and influences.
  • Campioni, Guiliano, Paolo D’Iorio, Maria Cristina Fornari, Francesco Fronterotta & Andrea Orsucci (eds.) (2003): Nietzsches persönliche Bibliothek. Berlin (Walter de Gruyter Press).
    • A comprehensive collection of Nietzsche’s personal library, essential for reconstructing what Nietzsche read about history and historoical theory.
  • Cancik, Hubert, Nietzsches Antike: Vorlesung (Stuttgart: J.B. Metzler Verlag, 1995).
    • An examination of Nietzsche’s philological activities from one of the world’s leading historians of philology.
  • Dries, Manuel (ed.), Nietzsche on Time and History (Berlin: De Gruyter Press, 2008).
    • A fine collection of essays from leading and upcoming scholars, many of which address Nietzsche’s thinking about history.
  • Drossbach, Maximillian, Über scheinbaren und wirklichen Ursachen des Geschehens in der Welt (Halle: Pfeffer, 1884).
    • A naturalistic rejection of teleological historical explanation that Nietzsche read shortly before the composition of On the Genealogy of Morals.
  • Emden, Christian, Friedrich Nietzsche and the Politics of History (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008).
    • A highly-informative contextualized account of Nietzsche’s historical theory, with special reference to the culture and politics of Basel during Nietzsche’s tenure.
  • Geuss, Raymond, “Nietzsche and Genealogy,” European Journal of Philosophy 2 (1994): 275–92.
    • An especially clear account of Nietzsche’s explanatory strategies in the Genealogy of Morals.
  • Gossman, Lionel, Basel in the Age of Burckhardt: A Study in Unseasonable Ideas (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2000).
  • A foundational account of Nietzsche’s intellectual milieu in the 1860’s-70’s.
  • Hartmann, Eduard von, Philosophie des Unbewussten: Speculative Resultate nach inductiv-naturwissenschaftlicher Methode (Berlin: Carl Duncker, 1869).
    • One of Nietzsche’s most important sources of teleological historiography and the main target of his ire in the second Untimely Meditation.
  • Jensen, Anthony K., Nietzsche’s Philosophy of History (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2013).
    • A comprehensive account of Nietzsche’s historical theory and its shifts over the course of his career.
  • Jensen, Anthony K. & Heit, Helmut (eds.), Nietzsche as a Scholar of Antiquity (New York / London: Bloomsbury Publishing, 2014).
    • A collection of articles that covers the scope of Nietzsche’s publications and lecture notes during his time as a classical philologist.
  • Lipperheide, Christian, Nietzsches Geschichtsstrategien. Die rhetorische Neuorganisation der Geschichte (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 1999).
    • A narrativist and constructivist reading of Nietzsche’s philosophy of history.
  • Meyer, Katrin, Ästhetik der Historie: Friedrich Nietzsches ‘vom Nutzen und Nachteil der Historie für das Leben’ (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 1998).
    • An analysis of the second Untimely Meditation from the perspective of Nietzsche’s aesthetic theory.
  • Nehamas, Alexander, “The Genealogy of Genealogy: Interpretation in Nietzsche’s Second Untimely Meditation and in On the Genealogy of Morals,” in Nietzsche, Genealogy, and Morality, edited by Richard Schacht (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1994), 269–83.
    • Considers Nietzsche’s genealogical mode of philosophizing as a more elaborate but nevertheless consistent expression of his earlier philological methodology.
  • Pletsch, Carl, Young Nietzsche: Becoming a Genius (New York: The Free Press, 1991).
    • An intellectual biography of Nietzsche’s early years, with special attention to his schooling and time at Basel.
  • Porter, James I., Nietzsche and the Philology of the Future (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2000).
    • Remains the decisive account of Nietzsche’s philological study, articles, and lectures.
  • Reinhardt, Karl, “Nietzsche und die Geschichte,” in his Vermächtnis der Antike. Gesammelte Essays zur Philosophie und Geschichtsschreibung (Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1960), 296–309.
    • A dated, but still informative critique of Nietzsche’s contribution to philology from one of the leading classicists of the 20th Century.
  • Ritschl, Friedrich, Opuscula Philologica, 5 vols., edited by Kurt Wachsmuth (Leipzig: Teubner, 1879).
    • The badly-neglected collected works of Nietzsche’s teacher, containing, among many other things, observations and exhortations about the contemporary practice of classical philology as Nietzsche would have known them.
  • Saar, Martin, Genealogie als Kritik: Geschichte und Theorie des Subjekts nach Nietzsche und Foucault (Frankfurt/New York: Campus Verlag, 2007).
    • An admirable attempt to compare the historical theories of Foucault and Nietzsche from the standpoint of their respective notions of subjectivity.
  • Salaquarda, Jörg, “Studien zur Zweiten Unzeitgemäßen Betrachtung,” Nietzsche-Studien 13 (1984): 1–45.
    • The most comprehensive account of the genesis and context of the second Untimely Meditation in any language.
  • Schrift, Alan, Nietzsche and the Question of Interpretation: Between Hermeneutics and Deconstruction (New York/London: Routledge, 1990).
    • A decisive continental treatment of Nietzsche’s thinking generally, with special attention to Nietzsche’s theory of historical interpretation.
  • Sommer, Andreas Urs, Der Geist der Historie und das Ende des Christentums. Zur „Waffengenossenschaft“ von Friedrich Nietzsche und Franz Overbeck (Berlin: Akademie Verlag, 1997).
    • A highly-informed comparison of Nietzsche and the theological historian Franz Overbeck concerning especially teleology and Christian historiography.
  • Stambaugh, Joan, The Problem of Time in Nietzsche, translated by John F. Humphrey (Philadelphia: Bucknell University Press, 1987).
    • A seminal examination of the interrelation of history, temporality, subjectivity, and willing in Nietzsche.
  • White, Hayden, Metahistory: The Historical Imagination in Nineteenth-Century Europe (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1973).
    • Includes an attempt to read Nietzsche as a precursor to post-modern historical narrativity. White is one of the leading philosophers of history in the world.


Author Information

Anthony K. Jensen
Providence College
U. S. A.

Meaning of Life: Contemporary Analytic Perspectives

Depending upon whom one asks, the question, “What is the meaning of life?” may be one of the most profound questions of human existence or nothing more than a nonsensical request built on conceptual confusion, much like, “What does the color red taste like?” Ask a non-philosopher, “What do philosophers discuss?” and a likely answer will be, “The meaning of life.” Ask the same question of a philosopher within the analytic tradition, and you will rarely get this answer. Within the analytic philosophical community, the disinterest in the question of life’s meaning, and in some cases outright logical suspicion, is likely partly a result of the question’s inherent lack of clarity and partly a result of the suspicion that it is a request for which no answer exists because it is built on suspect assumptions about what would have to be the case in order for life to have a meaning. Indeed, it is not immediately clear what is being requested in asking the question of life’s meaning, nor is it clear that life could have such a meaning, given latent assumptions often accompanying the asking of the question.

Despite the relative disinterest in the question of life’s meaning among analytic philosophers for a large part of the twentieth century, there has been a growing body of work on the topic by contemporary analytic philosophers since the 1980’s. The parameters in which the philosophical discussion of the meaning of life is unfolding within analytic philosophy largely center on two dimensions: the first, with bringing clarity and sense to the question, and the second, on fitting the concept of meaning within the realm of normativity in general, and then with discovering the necessary and sufficient conditions for a meaningful life.

This article surveys the important trajectories in discussions of life’s meaning within contemporary analytic philosophy. It begins with a consideration of an important generating condition of the question of life’s meaning, one that Thomas Nagel has particularly noted (Nagel 1971, 1989)—the human ability to view life sub specie aeternitatis. Next, it surveys current analytic philosophical discussions over the following prominent themes: (i) strategies for understanding what the question is asking, (ii) extant views of how a meaningful life can be secured, and (iii) the connection between death, futility, and a meaningful life. This article concludes by noting some considerations that may bring further depth to discussions over life’s meaning as they progress.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Human Context
  3. The Meaning of Life in Contemporary Analytic Philosophy
    1. Addressing the Question’s Lack of Clarity: Securing a Non-linguistic Usage of “Meaning”
    2. Addressing the Question’s Lack of Clarity: The Amalgam Thesis
    3. A Meaningful Life: Current Views
      1. Supernaturalism
      2. Objective Naturalism
      3. Subjective Naturalism
      4. Pessimistic Naturalism: Nihilism
    4. Death, Futility, and a Meaningful Life
  4. The Future of the Discussion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Vis-à-vis the meaning of life, there are two juxtaposed and incongruent realities. On the one hand, for a large part of the twentieth century, analytic philosophers generally ignored the question of life’s meaning because they were doubtful that it had no answer. This doubt was because of latent assumptions on the part of many who ask the question about what would have to be the case for life to have a meaning or because they were suspicious that it is incoherent and meaningless. On the other hand, most non-philosophers consider it one of the most important questions, if not the most important question, of human existence. This, of course, creates a prima facie impasse, given that the question of life’s meaning is one that many of those supposedly functioning as guardians of the canons of reason think is rationally sub-par or at least less deserving of philosophical energy than is a consideration of, for example, how consciousness and accompanying qualia arise from matter or whether discussions of epistemic luck and control hold the key to discovering the necessary and sufficient conditions of propositional knowledge.

While this trend of neglect is unfortunate, it is partly understandable given that the question, “What is the meaning of life?” is at least moderately characterized by a lack of clarity (and some would say a lack of coherence). Philosophically, the question therefore has seemed unmanageable to many. It is surely not a question about the semantic meaning of the word “life,” but what then is it a question about? Is it a question about human life? Is it a question about all biological life? Is it a question about all of existence? Is it asking for a comprehensive explanation of why the universe exists and of our place within it? And if so, is it asked with strong teleological assumptions at the fore, such that a purely efficient, mechanistic causal story would leave the inquirer unsatisfied? These latter questions with a global focus seem to track a request like, “What is it all about?” Indeed, there is a profound human impulse to seek a sweeping, deep explanation, context, or narrative through which to interpret existence, and then to move beyond localized foci by living into this universal, totalizing narrative. This first cluster of questions highlights the explanatory dimension of the question of life’s meaning whereby some sort of explanation (perhaps even narrative explanation) is sought that will render the universe and our lives within it intelligible. Conceding the question’s lack of clarity, these requests partially illuminate what is being asked.

However, raising these questions alone neglects other important questions in the neighborhood of life’s meaning. Though connected, they are conceptually distinct from the first set; although, depending on how robust the above explanation of what it is all about is, one might have good reason to think that it would also encompass this second dimension. In any case, while related to the explanatory dimension, these next questions highlight the normative dimension of the meaning of life question. When asking these, we are more concerned with the aim of securing a meaningful life. We wonder what we must, or should, or ought to order our lives around so as to render them meaningful. Meaningfulness, then, perhaps supervenes on a life properly ordered around the right stuff. Questions within this dimension include, “What is (are) the purpose(s) of life (my life)?” “What makes life valuable?” or “What makes life worthwhile and not irredeemably futile?”

Most philosophers currently writing on the topic think the question of life’s meaning is somehow a question about all of these and other related topics, but only insofar as it is viewed as a long disjunctive question or an amalgam of related yet distinct requests about purpose, value, worth, significance, death, and futility, among others. Furthermore, though it is viewed as a request that moves us into normative territory, this question is thought to be distinct from purely ethical requests about rightness and wrongness, purely aesthetic requests about the good and beautiful, and purely eudaimonistic requests about human happiness and flourishing, while bearing some relationship to all three. There is little consensus beyond this minimal agreement.

2. The Human Context

The human preoccupation with the question of life’s meaning is at least partly generated by our capacity to get-outside-of ourselves and view our pursuits and very lives first-person oriented and distantly from a detached, more-or-less dispassionate standpoint (see Nagel 1971; 1989; Fischer 1993). We, unlike butterflies or cats for example, can take a  critical viewpoint on our lives. We possess the ability to shift from engagement to reflection. We question what we do. We question how what we do coheres with the rest of reality, and whether reality, at the deepest level, in any way cares about us and our pursuits. We can view our lives sub specie aeternitatis, after which we can either experience profound angst, indifference, or hope, among other reactions, depending upon what we think that viewpoint entails. Whether, in normative appraisals of life, it is reasonable to privilege this detached perspective over our immediate, human perspective is beside the point. The fact is we often do, and this human propensity is correlated with inquiring into the meaning of life.

3. The Meaning of Life in Contemporary Analytic Philosophy

Contemporary analytic philosophy has inherited important trajectories from the ancient and modern worlds, whether from Qohelet, Schopenhauer, Tolstoy, Camus, or Sartre among others, vis-à-vis the meaning of life. But, understandably, the analytic philosophical impulse toward conceptual clarification has given discussions of the meaning of life within this tradition a unique shape. Indeed, a significant portion of the discussion within this contemporary context has been primarily concerned with trying to understand the question itself. Is it coherent? Is it meaningful? What is it asking? What assumptions motivate the question? Asking such questions is necessary because the question of life’s meaning lacks clarity and has an elusive quality to it. Analytic philosophers have rightly noticed this. There exist a couple of options for addressing this lack of clarity short of the outright charge of incoherence that was common for a substantial portion of the twentieth century in the wake of logical positivism’s once strong grip.

a. Addressing the Question’s Lack of Clarity: Securing a Non-linguistic Usage of “Meaning”

One option for addressing the clarity problem is to retain the use of the word “meaning” and to secure a usage that applies to non-linguistic phenomena, given that in asking the question of life’s meaning, one is not asking for the semantic meaning of the word “life.” This strategy is especially concerned with finding a natural interpretation of the question through a plausible employment of the term “meaning.” “Meaning” has multiple meanings, and at least some of the more prominent ones mitigate its usefulness in the context of trying to formulate the intuitions driving the question of life’s meaning. Indeed, if one is asking for the semantic meaning of life rather than “life,” then the accusation of incoherence is plausible. We ask for the meanings of semantic constructions, but not of things like physical entities, events, or life in general. The problem then is that “meaning” is a term which appears to most naturally find its home within a linguistic context. However, life itself is not such a context. That is to say, in asking the question, one is not asking for any sort of definition of “life” or a description of this term’s usage. But then, what is being asked? This is where the problem lies.

The problem is solvable, though, given that asking what something means need not be a request for a definition or description. There are additional non-linguistic contexts in which the locution, “What is the meaning of x?” makes perfect sense (for example, intentional signification, non-intentional signification (that is, natural signs), and so forth.) (see Nozick 1981). Some of them even share family resemblances to the question of life’s meaning. One in particular is especially relevant.

The question, “What is the meaning of x?” functions naturally in the largely non-linguistic context in which we seek to know how something fits within a larger context or narrative. We naturally and legitimately invoke the formula, “What is the meaning of x?” in situations where x is some fact, event, or phenomenon we encounter and of which we want to know the fact’s or event’s or phenomenon’s “. . . implication in the wider world within which this notion [or fact, event, or phenomenon] makes the sense it makes” (Wright 2003: 719). This “wider world” Wright considers to be a worldview, metanarrative, or something similar.

To make his point, Wright uses the example of how one comes to understand the Easter Event (that is, the putative bodily resurrection of Jesus of Nazerath). For example, a well-educated Roman soldier who comes to learn of the event may contextualize it, and therefore “fix” its meaning, through the myth of Nero redivivus, the idea that Nero had come back to life in order to return to Rome in all his glory. The event means something different for him than for, say, Saul of Tarsus. The wider worldview framework or narrative (or even simply a more localized narrative which is, itself, part of a larger worldview narrative) will play a heavy hermeneutical role, then, in “discovering” (some may prefer determining) what any given fact, event, or phenomenon means. Discovering this meaning will be a product of asking and answering questions like: In what larger narrative(s) does the sentence (intended to refer to a fact, event, or phenomenon) belong? What worldviews do such narratives embody and reinforce? What are the universes of discourse within which this sentence, and the event it refers to, settle down and make themselves at home – and which, at the same time, they challenge and reshape from within? (Wright 2003: 719).

In terms of the meaning of life, one could argue that we are trying to find the “wider world” (i.e., worldview, metanarrative) in which the existentially salient elements and accompanying questions of life fit. These existentially salient elements and accompanying questions of life, for which the word “life” is a marker, are perennial meaning of life themes. They are what often prompt in us the grand question: “What is the meaning of life?” and include:

(1) Fact—something exists, we [humans] exist, and I exist / Question—Why does anything or we or I exist at all?

(2) Question—Does life have any purpose(s), and if so, what is its nature and source?

(3) Fact—we are often passionately engaged in life pursuits and projects that we deem valuable and worthwhile / Question—Does the worth and value of these pursuits and projects need grounding in something else, and if so, what?

(4) Fact—pain and suffering are part of the universe / Question—Why?

(5) Question—How does it all end? Is death final? Is there an eschatological remedy to the ills of this world?

(1) – (5) constitute the cluster of considerations that track discussions of life’s meaning, even though reasonable debate will exist about the details. In asking, “What is the meaning of life?” it is plausible to view this as the request for a “wider world” (that is, worldview, metanarrative) through which to secure answers to these questions. Viewed as such, this renders the question, “What is the meaning of life?” coherent and intelligible by securing a usage of “meaning” that fits naturally within a non-linguistic context.

b. Addressing the Question’s Lack of Clarity: The Amalgam Thesis



The most common interpretive strategy for understanding what the question, “What is the meaning of life?” involves discarding the word “meaning” and reformulating the question entirely. With this approach, the question is morphed into a cluster of other supposedly less vague questions, even if no less difficult to answer:  “What is (are) the purpose(s) of life?”, or “What makes life valuable?”, or “What makes life worthwhile and not irredeemably futile?” among others.

Following precedent in the literature, especially R. W. Hepburn, this approach for addressing the vagueness in the question of life’s meaning may be called the amalgam thesis (Hepburn 1966). Roughly, the amalgam thesis entails that the original question, framed in terms of meaning, is a largely ill-conceived place-holder for a cluster of related requests, and thus, not really a single question at all. One way of understanding the amalgam thesis is to view it as making the question of life’s meaning little more than a disjunctive question:

What is the purpose of life, or what makes life valuable, or what makes life worthwhile?

On amalgam thesis premises the question, “What is the meaning of life?” ought  to be a question about purpose, or value, or worth or something else. However one worry is that these questions are primarily about purpose, value, and worth and  then secondly about the meaning of life.

Due to the dominance of the amalgam thesis as an interpretive strategy and its arguable philosophical merit, most contemporary philosophical treatments of the question of life’s meaning consider it in one of its reformulated versions such as, “What makes life valuable?”, “What makes life significant?”, “What is (are) the purpose(s) of life?”, “Does a particular life achieve some good purpose?”, or “What makes life worth living?” among others. So, there exist at least two interpretive levels of the question using the amalgam thesis, one tracking something like the question’s formal properties, and the other tracking the subsequent questions’ material content. In other words, the amalgam thesis implies that the question, “What is the meaning of life?” is really just a disjunctive question whereby requests about purpose, value, worth, and significance are made.

c. A Meaningful Life: Current Views

Beyond discussions over the nature of the question itself, one will find competing views on what gives life meaning, whereby meaningfulness is meant. That is to say, by virtue of what can life be said to be meaningful, if it all? The four primary competitors are: (1) Supernaturalism, (2) Objective Naturalism, (3) Subjective Naturalism, and (4) Nihilism (inter-subjectivism and non-naturalism are additional options, but are much less prevalent). Importantly, both objective and subjective naturalism can be categorized as optimistic naturalisms, in that these views allow for a meaningful existence in a world devoid of finite and infinite spiritual realities. Pessimistic naturalism is what is commonly called “nihilism.” Nihilism is generally a view adopted alongside an entirely naturalistic ontology (though vigorous debate exits about whether naturalism entails nihilism), although there is nothing logically impossible about someone adopting nihilism while being a religious believer. One will be hard-pressed, however, to find genuine examples of this belief, save some sort of rhetorical, provisional nihilism, as found in Ecclesiastes in the Bible.

i. Supernaturalism

Roughly, supernaturalism maintains that God’s existence, along with “appropriately relating” to God, is both necessary and sufficient for securing a meaningful life, although different accounts can be given as to the nature of this relationship. Among countless others, historic representatives of supernaturalism in the Near-Eastern ancient world and in subsequent Western history are Qoheleth, Jesus, Paul, Augustine, Aquinas, Edwards, Pascal, and Tolstoy. The supernaturalist position can be plausibly viewed as possessing three distinct yet related dimensions: metaphysical, epistemological, and relational-axiological. Metaphysically, it is argued that God’s existence is necessary in order to ground a meaningful life because, for example, conditions necessary for securing a meaningful existence like objective value are most plausibly anchored in an entity like God (Cottingham 2005; Craig 2008). In addition to the metaphysical dimension, supernaturalism often requires, at some level, orthodoxy (right belief) and orthopraxy (right practice), although much debate exists on the details. God’s existence may be a necessary condition for securing a meaningful life, but it is generally thought that one must additionally relate to God in some relevant way in the epistemological and axiological dimensions (In addition to God-based supernaturalist theories, there are soul-based theories, where meaning in life is thought to be a function, not so much of God, but rather of having an indestructible soul whereby immortality is possible).

ii. Objective Naturalism

Objective naturalism, like supernaturalism, posits that a meaningful life is possible, but denies that a supernatural realm is necessary for such a life. Life in a purely physical world, devoid of finite and infinite spiritual realities, is sufficient for meaning according to objective naturalism. Objective naturalists claim that a meaningful life is a function of appropriately connecting with mind-independent realities that are, contra supernaturalism, entirely natural. Objective naturalism is further distinguished (from subjective naturalism) by its emphasis on mind-independence. One way of putting the point is to say that wanting or choosing is insufficient for a meaningful life. For example, choosing to spend one’s waking hours counting and re-counting blades of grass is likely insufficient for meaning on objective naturalism. Rather, meaning is a function of linking one’s life to inherently valuable, mind-independent conditions that are not themselves the sole products of what one wants strongly and chooses (contra subjective naturalism). Put simply, with objective naturalism it is possible to be wrong about what confers meaning on life—something is meaningful, at least partly, in virtue of its intrinsic nature, irrespective of what is believed about it. This is why spending one’s entire existence counting blades of grass or reading and re-reading phone books is probably not meaningful on objective naturalism, even if the person strongly desires to do so.

iii. Subjective Naturalism

Like objective naturalism, subjective naturalism posits that a meaningful life is possible apart from something like supernaturalism being true, but unlike objective naturalism, it differs on what confers meaning to life. According to subjective naturalism, what constitutes a meaningful life varies from person to person, and is a function of one getting what one strongly wants, or by achieving self-established goals, or through accomplishing what one believes to be really important. Caring about or loving something deeply has been thought by some to confer meaningfulness to life (Frankfurt 1988). Subjectivism seems most plausible to some in light of perceived failures to ground objective value, either naturally, non-naturally, or supernaturally. A worry for subjective naturalism, however, is analogous to ethical worries over moral relativism. Many protest that surely deep care and love simpliciter are not sufficient to confer meaningfulness on life. What if someone claims to find meaning in life counting blades of grass, or reading and re-reading the phone book, or worse, torturing people for fun? Can a life centering on such pursuits be a meaningful life? The strong, nearly universal intuition here towards objective value in some form inclines in the direction of requiring an objective standard that comes to bear on the meaningfulness of an activity or life in general. Subjectivism still has its defenders, with some proposals moving towards grounding value inter-subjectively—in community—as opposed to in the individual exclusively.

Nuanced forms of naturalism, vis-à-vis meaningfulness in life, make room for both objective and subjective elements, as is captured nicely by Susan Wolf, “Meaning arises when subjective attraction meets objective attractiveness” (Wolf 1997: 211). On this view, the objective and the subjective must unite in order to give birth to robust meaningfulness. Meaningfulness is not present in a life spent believing in, being satisfied by, or caring about worthless projects.However neither is it present in a life spent engaging in worthwhile, inherently valuable projects without believing in, or caring about, or being satisfied by them.

Though they are in disagreement on the conditions for meaningfulness, both objective and subjective naturalism are united in their rejection of supernaturalism and supernaturalism’s insistence that God is necessary in order to secure a meaningful life. In this way, both forms of naturalism, vis-à-vis meaningfulness in life, can be thought of as optimistic naturalisms—that is, meaningful life is possible in a godless universe. An optimistic naturalist sees no problem in thinking that a meaningful life can be secured within an entirely naturalistic ontology. Nothing additional, nothing of the transcendent sort, is needed to ground those things in life that we, pre-philosophically, find to be meaningful. The raw materials for meaningfulness are available apart from God.

iv. Pessimistic Naturalism: Nihilism

Against all views which think a meaningful existence is possible, is the view of pessimistic naturalism, more commonly called nihilism. Roughly, nihilism is the view that denies that a meaningful life is possible because, literally, nothing has any value. One way to understand nihilism is by seeing it as the fusion of theses and assumptions drawn from both supernaturalism and naturalism. That is to say, nihilism may be seen as requiring (i) that God or some supernatural realm is likely necessary for value and a meaningful existence, but (ii) that no such realm exists, and therefore nothing is of ultimate value. Other forms of nihilism focus on states like boredom or dissatisfaction, arguing that boredom sufficiently infuses life so as to make it meaningless, or that human lives lack the requisite amount of satisfaction to confer meaning upon them. Another form of nihilism that is logically compatible with the existence of God is one based upon a disparity between standpoints. It has been argued that from the most distant, detached viewpoint, nothing we do seems to matter at all. If one thinks that it is possible to view even God and the economy of his workings from some more distant standpoint, then even supernaturalism may face a nihilistic threat of this form.

d. Death, Futility, and a Meaningful Life

The meaning of life is closely linked with a cluster of related issues surrounding death, futility, and the way life is going to end, in regards to both the individual life and to the universe as a whole. These are common threads in the meaning of life literature, from Ecclesiastes to Camus to contemporary analytic philosophy. Death (and the end of the universe itself) often is thought to bear a close relationship with futility. The common pessimistic claim is that cosmic futility supervenes upon the entirety of human existence, given a naturalistic view of the ultimate fate of life, both human life as well as the universe itself, where death and entropy will very likely be the final, irreversible state of reality.

Why is death in an exclusively naturalistic world thought by many to be a challenge to a meaningful life? One reason may be the widespread view that, ceteris paribus, meaningful things last, as in ’diamonds are forever’’. Vis-à-vis the meaning of life, most people judge various aspects of life, pre-philosophically, to be meaningful. When subsequently engaged in conscious reflection on the necessary conditions for meaningfulness, immortality is often thought to be transcendentally necessary (though not sufficient) for meaningfulness. Many people desire consciousness, memory, personhood, love, creativity, and achievement to be part of the deep structure of reality, in that the universe, in the long run, makes space for these things. An exclusively naturalistic universe likely does not. From the perspective of a universe that will very likely become unfavorable to the existence of intelligent life, nothing we do seems of any real consequence or value. Death, both our own and the universe’s (speaking metaphorically of course), is a profound barrier to the meaningful properties and activities that populate human existence continuing on in any robust sense. And so the threat of futility lingers for many who worry that we live in an exclusively naturalistic universe.

The kind of futility surfacing in this context can be thought of as strong futility or weak futility. In the strong sense, it is claimed that if the final state of affairs of the universe (e.g. heat death) is one in which nothing matters, then nothing ever really mattered and everything is irredeemably futile. In the weaker sense, it is claimed that if the final state of affairs of the universe is one in which nothing matters, then the mattering or significance of current states of affairs is in some way mitigated, either minimally or considerably, though not completely destroyed. This futility partly arises, then, through an asymmetry between the vantage points of the lifeless, distant future that lacks consciousness of any sort, and the present filled with conscious life and its various dimensions. A “bad” ending is thought to threaten the meaningfulness of the entire story.

Critics of these strong and weak futility claims counter by calling into question what can be called the-arbitrary-privileging-of-the-future. They ask, “Why should the end state of affairs be given such veto power over the worth and meaning of the here and now?” It has been noted that appealing to such asymmetry by which to charge naturalism with irredeemable futility is contingent upon a suspect assumption; namely, arbitrarily placing an undue amount of importance (perhaps all the importance) on the final state of affairs to which life leads. But why give the future priority over the present and the past?If life is meaningful now, how can the fact that it will cease to exist make it less meaningful now? And, if life is not meaningful now, how could its un-ending continuation confer meaningfulness to it? Critics of such futility claims argue that the most plausible way to appraise the meaningfulness and worth of life here and now, is by adopting the here and now perspective, not the distant, detached perspective of some indifferent future of a universe in ruins. Of course, one might make the converse claim, “Why privilege the present over the future?” Principled reasons must be offered that will help settle the question of which viewpoint—the distant-future or the immediate-present—gets normative priority for appraisals of life as either worthwhile or futile.

4. The Future of the Discussion

Within normative theory, one underexplored question is where the concept of meaningfulness fits within the normative realm shared by the ethical, aesthetic, and eudaimonistic. Meaning seems closely connected to these other normative categories, but reducible to none (though it is perhaps closest to the third). One can perhaps imagine ethical lives that are, for example, profoundly unsatisfying to the one who lives them. And even if the ethical is one component of the meaningful, it seems implausible to think that an apathetic, yet morally exemplary life, qualifies as fully meaningful, especially if one thinks that meaningfulness is at least partly a function of being subjectively attracted to objective attractiveness. Meaningfulness extends beyond the ethical, while somehow including it. These same sorts of questions can be raised regarding the relationship between meaningfulness and other normative categories.

In addition, the debate between reductive naturalists and non-reductive naturalists has direct implications for whether it can be thought that normative properties are part of the deep structure of reality on naturalism. If they are, then optimistic naturalism of the objective variety will gain the upper hand over subjective optimistic naturalism. So, progress in the debate between objective and subjective naturalism will track progress in discussions within metaphysics more generally.

Or, consider the problem of evil in the philosophy of religion. The experience of evil links to the meaning of life, especially when one considers death and futility. Quite apart from philosophical reflections on the problem, the experience of evil is often one of those generating conditions of the question of life’s meaning born out of existential angst. Is there an intelligible, existentially satisfying narrative in which to locate the experience of pain and suffering and to give the sufferer some solace and hope? Evil in a meaningful universe may not cease from being evil, but it may be more bearable. In this way, the problem of meaning may be more foundational than the problem of evil. And one especially thinks of what we might call the eschatological dimension of the problem of evil—is there any hope in the face of pain, suffering, and death, and if so, what is its nature? Bringing future-oriented considerations of pain and suffering into the philosophical discussion will also naturally link to perennial meaning of life topics like death and futility. Additionally, it will motivate more vigorous research and debate over whether the inherent human desire for a felicitous ending to life’s narrative, including, for example, post-mortem survival and enjoyment of the beatific vision or some other blessed state is mere wishful thinking or a cousin to our desire for water, and thus, a truly natural desire that points to a referent capable of fulfilling it. In any case, discussions over the problem of evil are correlated with discussions over the meaning of life, and progress in one might be significant for progress in the other.

Finally, an underexplored area in contemporary analytic philosophy is how the concept of narrative might shed light on the meaning of life. One reason this is important can be seen in the following. Historically, most of the satisfying narratives that in some way narrated the meaning of life were also religious or quasi-religious. Additionally, many of these narratives count as narratives in the paradigmatic sense as opposed to non-narrative modes of discourse. However, with the rise of modern science, both the narratives and the religious or quasi-religious worldviews embodied in them were diminished in certain spheres. This led to the anxious questioning of life’s meaning and the fear that a thoroughly scientific-naturalistic narrative of the universe is far from existentially satisfying. This elicits the following important question: Are such paradigmatic instances of narratives which, in some way, narrate the meaning of life, thought to be more existentially satisfying in virtue of their explicitly religious perspective on the world or in virtue of the fact that they are paradigmatic instances of narrative or both? In terms of an interdisciplinary approach, the work of cognitive scientists who are informing us that personal identity has a substantial narrative component may be of benefit here. Perhaps our deep human need to construct meaningful narratives in order to contextualize parts of our lives and our very lives themselves is genetically hardwired. More specifically, perhaps our existential need to locate our lives and the profound elements that populate human life within grand narratives that are paradigmatic instances of narrative is genetically hardwired. If something like this is correct, then it may become clearer why questioning the meaning of life with such intensity and angst is correlated with the rise of a grand narrative (that is, naturalism) that is not a narrative in the paradigmatic sense.

Within a philosophical tradition that has had relatively little to say about the meaning of life, there are signs of change. Since the 1980’s, some within the ranks of analytic philosophy have turned their attention to life’s great question. The question is approached with an analytic rigor that will hopefully illumine some of the assumptions motivating it and point in the direction of possible approaches for answering it. Much work remains to be done. The philosophical waters remain murky, but they are clearing.

See also The Meaning of Life: Early Continental and Analytic Perspectives.

5. References and Further Reading

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  • Cottingham, John. On the Meaning of Life. London: Routledge, 2003.
  • Cottingham, John. The Spiritual Dimension: Religion, Philosophy and Human Value. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
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  • Levine, Michael. “What Does Death Have to Do with the Meaning of Life?” Religious Studies 23 (1987): 457-65.
  • Levy, Neil. “Downshifting and Meaning in Life.” Ratio 18 (June 2005): 176-89.
  • Lewis, C. S. “De Futilitate.” in Christian Reflections. Grand Rapids, MI: William B. Eerdmans Publishing Company, 1995.
  • Lewis, C. S. “On Living in an Atomic Age,” in Present Concerns. San Diego: Harcourt, Inc., 1986.
  • Longman III, Tremper. The Book of Ecclesiastes. Grand Rapids, MI: William B. Eerdmans Publishing Company, 1998.
  • Luper-Foy, Stephen. “Annihilation.” Philosophical Quarterly 37 (July 1987): 233-52.
  • Lurie, Yuval. Tracking the Meaning of Life: A Philosophical Journey. Columbia, MO: University of Missouri Press, 2006.
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  • Martin, Michael. Atheism, Morality, and Meaning. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books, 2002.
  • Mawson, Timothy J. “Sources of Dissatisfaction with Answers to the Question of the Meaning of Life.” European Journal for Philosophy of Religion 2 (Autumn 2010): 19-41.
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  • Metz, Thaddeus. “The Concept of a Meaningful Life.” American Philosophical Quarterly 38 (April 2001): 137-53.
  • Metz, Thaddeus. “Could God’s Purpose be the Source of Life’s Meaning?” Religious Studies 36 (2000): 293-313.
  • Metz, Thaddeus. “Critical Notice: Baier and Cottingham on the Meaning of Life.” Disputatio 19 (2005): 251-64.
  • Metz, Thaddeus. “God’s Purpose as Irrelevant to Life’s Meaning: Reply to Affolter.” Religious Studies 43 (December 2007): 457-64.
  • Metz, Thaddeus. “The Good, the True, and the Beautiful: Toward  a Unified Account of Great Meaning in Life.” Religious Studies 47 (December 2011): 389-409.
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  • Metz, Thaddeus. "The Meaning of Life," The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2007 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).
  • Metz, Thaddeus. “New Developments in the Meaning of Life.” Philosophy Compass 2 (2007): 196-217.
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Author Information

Joshua Seachris
University of Notre Dame
U. S. A.

Social and Political Recognition

Acts of recognition infuse many aspects of our lives such as receiving a round of applause from a rapt audience, being spotted in a crowded street by a long-forgotten friend, having an application for a job rejected because of your criminal record, enjoying some words of praise by a respected philosophy professor, getting pulled over by the police because you are a black man driving an expensive car, and fighting to have your same-sex marriage officially sanctioned in order to enjoy the same benefits as hetero-sexual marriages. Evidently the various ways we are recognised (and recognise others) play an important role in shaping our quality of life. Recognition theorists go further than this, arguing that recognition can help form, or even determine, our sense of who we are and the value accorded to us as individuals.

Political theories of recognition, which attempt to reconfigure the concept of justice in terms of due or withheld recognition, can be contrasted with (but set alongside) the rise of multiculturalism, which has produced an array of literature focused on recognising, accommodating and respecting difference. Although these two trajectories overlap, there are important differences between them. Multicultural politics is rooted in the identity politics underlying various social movements that gained prominence during the 1960s, such as the civil rights movement and radical/cultural feminism. These movements tend to emphasise the distinctness and value of their cultural identity and demand group-specific rights to protect this uniqueness. Without depreciating identity politics and multiculturalism, this article is primarily concerned with political theories of recognition, particularly those formulated by Charles Taylor (who is also a prominent figure in multicultural politics), Nancy Fraser and Axel Honneth. These focus on the role played by recognition in individual identity formation and the normative foundation this can provide to theories of justice.

Despite its brief history as an explicitly political concept, philosophical interest in the idea of recognition can be traced to the work of Hegel, who first coined the phrase ‘struggle for recognition’ (kampf um anerkennung). This article begins by clarifying the specific political and philosophical meaning of recognition. It will provides an overview of Hegel’s remarks on recognition before proceeding to identify the contemporary advocates of recognition. It presents the main similarities and differences between these authors before examining some important criticisms levelled at concept of recognition. The conclusion is a reflection upon the increasing influence of recognition and how it may develop in the future.

Table of Contents

  1. Defining Recognition
  2. The Hegelian Legacy
  3. Contemporary Theories of Recognition
    1. Charles Taylor
    2. Axel Honneth
    3. Nancy Fraser
  4. Redistribution or Recognition? The Fraser-Honneth Debate
  5. Criticisms of Recognition
    1. The Reification of Identity
    2. The Accusation of Essentialism
    3. The Danger of Subjectivism
    4. The Problem of the Other
    5. The Post-Structural Challenge
  6. The Future of Recognition
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Defining Recognition

The term ‘recognition’ has several distinct meanings: (1) an act of intellectual apprehension, such as when we ‘recognise’ we have made a mistake or we ‘recognise’ the influence of religion on American politics; (2) a form of identification, such as when we ‘recognise’ a friend in the street; and (3) the act of acknowledging or respecting another being, such as when we ‘recognise’ someone’s status, achievements or rights (upon the different meanings of recognition, see Inwood, 1992: 245-47; Margalit, 2001: 128-129). The philosophical and political notion of recognition predominantly refers to (3), and is often taken to mean that not only is recognition an important means of valuing or respecting another person, it is also fundamental to understanding ourselves.

Various attempts have been made to clarify precisely what is, and is not, to count as an act of recognition (perhaps most comprehensively by Ikäheimo and Laitinen, 2007). Ikäheimo (2002: 450) defines recognition as ‘always a case of A taking B as C in the dimension of D, and B taking A as a relevant judge’. Here A and B indicate two individual persons, specifically A is the recogniser and B the recognisee. C designates the attribute recognised in A, and D is the dimension of B’s personhood at stake. For example, I may recognise you as a person possessing certain rights and responsibilities in light of your being an autonomous, rational human being (for more on defining the structure of recognition, see Laitinen, 2002). A key feature of Ikäheimo’s definition is that it requires not only that someone be recognised by another, but that the person being recognised judges that the recogniser is capable of conferring recognition. This means that we must place sufficient value in the recogniser in order for their attitude towards us to count as recognitive. Brandom (2009) approaches this idea through the idea of authority, arguing that a genuine instance of recognition requires that we authorise someone to confer recognition. Similarly, one can gain authority and responsibility by petitioning others for recognition. Consequently, one has authority only insofar as one is recognised as authoritative.

We may not consider being valued by a wilful criminal as any sort of recognition in the sense being defined here. We do not judge them capable of conferring value on us, as we do not accord any value or respect to them. Similarly, someone who is coerced into recognising us may also fail to count as a relevant judge. A king who demands recognition of his superiority from all his subjects, simply in virtue of his being king, and threatens to punish them if they disobey, does not receive any meaningful kind of recognition for the subjects do not genuinely choose to confer value on him. Thus, in recognising another, we must also be recognised as a subject capable of giving recognition. This indicates that reciprocity or mutuality is likely to be a necessary condition of appropriate recognition (for a discussion of this point, see Laden, 2007).

A further issue in defining recognition is whether it is generative or responsive (Laitinen, 2002; Markell, 2007). A generation-model of recognition focuses on the ways in which recognition produces or generates reasons for actions or self-understandings. This is to say that someone ought to act in a certain way in virtue of being recognised as, for example, recognising someone as a rational being will generate certain duties and responsibilities for both the person being recognised and those who interact with him. A response-model of recognition focuses on the ways in which recognition acknowledges pre-existing features of a person. Here, to recognise someone is to acknowledge them as they already really are (Appiah, 1994: 149). This means that there are reasons why one ought to give recognition to someone prior to the act of recognition itself. Thus, for example, we ought to recognise someone’s ability to self-determination because they possess certain features, such as rational autonomy. The demand for recognition in a response-model is produced and justified through pre-existing characteristics of a person, whilst in the generation-model it is the act of recognition itself which confers those characteristics onto a person through their being recognised as such. The former is a case of person ‘knowing’, whilst the latter is a case of person ‘making’ (see Markell, 2002).

A third issue is whether groups or collectives can count as recognisers and recognisees. For example, when speaking of recognising a particular cultural group, do we mean we recognise that group qua a group, or as a collection of individuals? Similarly, does the granting of certain rights or respect apply to the group itself or the individual members belonging to that group? (For a detailed discussion and defence of group-differentiated minority rights, see Kymlicka, 1995). These questions revolve, at least in part, around the ontological status afforded to groups or collectives. Advocates of a politics of recognition are not always clear regarding whether or not groups can be granted recognition. Debates over the legitimacy or sovereignty of a state may depend upon the extent to which we recognise it as legitimate or sovereign. Important discussions of groups as entities include Tuomela (2007), Jones (2009) and List and Pettit (2011). However, as yet there has been little analysis of the connection between recognition and the ontology of groups. Charles Taylor (1994) argues for the importance of collective rights, but gives little consideration to whether collectives are genuine subjects over-and-above the individuals that constitute them. In his more recent work, Axel Honneth (Fraser and Honneth 2003: 159ff.) appears to give consideration to the possibility of groups as the object of recognition, but his general emphasis is on individual rights and recognition.

Common to all social and political notions of recognition is the shift from an atomistic to an intersubjective, dialogical understanding of the individual. Because our identity is shaped precisely through our relations to others, our being recognised by them, feelings of self-worth, self-respect and self-esteem are possible only if we are positively recognised for who we are. To this extent, theories of political recognition, which were first formulated in the 1990s, developed out of political movements centred upon such concepts as gender, sexuality, race, ethnicity and culture. Recognition, according to Taylor (1994), is an indispensible means of understanding and justifying the demands of these identity movements, which have had a major impact on society, particularly from the 1960s onwards. Consequently, for many political theorists, recognition is an integral component of any satisfactory modern theory of justice as well as the means by which both historical and contemporary political struggles can be understood and justified. In order to understand how such theories developed, it is necessary to examine their genesis within Hegel’s philosophy.

2. The Hegelian Legacy

Descartes’ dualistic philosophy of consciousness created an influential legacy in which the mind was characterised as a private theatre and knowledge of the self was achieved through introspection. This atomistic conception of self, encapsulated in Descartes’ cogito, filtered into the transcendental idealism of Kant (despite his objections to Descartes’ philosophy) and the transcendental phenomenology of Husserl, as well as being present in the contract theories of Hobbes and Locke. Against this trend there emerged a strongly intersubjective conception of selfhood that found expression through the concept of recognition, the founder of which is typically identified as Hegel. Although Hegel has undoubtedly influenced the contemporary understanding of recognition more than any other philosopher, Hegel was himself inspired by the work of Johann Fichte (see Williams, 1992). In his Foundations of Natural Right (1796/7), Fichte argues that the ‘I’ (the ego or pure consciousness) must posit itself as an individual to be able to understand itself as a free self. In order for such self-positing to occur, the individual must recognise itself as ‘summoned’ by another individual. This is to say, the individual must acknowledge the claims of other free individuals in order to understand itself as a being capable of action and possessing freedom. Hence, one’s freedom is both rendered possible and yet limited by the demands made on us by others. A key feature of this idea is that the same applies in reverse – the other can only comprehend itself as free by being recognised as such. Hence, mutual recognition is necessary for human beings to understand themselves as free individuals (as beings capable of ‘I-hood’). Through this analysis, Fichte produced a thoroughly intersubjective ontology of humans and demonstrated that freedom and self-understanding are dependent upon mutual recognition.

These ideas were developed in greater detail by Hegel. In his Phenomenology of Spirit Hegel (1807: 229) writes, ‘Self-consciousness exists in itself and for itself, in that, and by the fact that it exists for another self-consciousness; that is to say, it is only by being acknowledged or “recognized”’. Self-knowledge, including one’s sense of freedom and sense of self, is never a matter of simple introspection. Rather, understanding ourselves as an independent self-consciousness requires the recognition of another. One must recognise oneself as mediated through the other. As Sartre, who was heavily influenced by Hegel, wrote, ‘The road of interiority passes through the Other’ (Sartre, 1943: 236-7). The idea of recognition is developed further in Hegel’s mature works, particularly Elements of the Philosophy of Right (1821), where it becomes an essential factor in the development of ethical life (sittlichkeit). According to Hegel, it is through the intersubjective recognition of our freedom that right is actualised. Rights are not instrumental to freedom; rather they are the concrete expression of it. Without recognition we could not come to realise freedom, which in turn gives rise to right. The work of Hegel consciously echoes the Aristotelian conception of humans as essentially social beings. For Hegel, recognition is the mechanism by which our existence as social beings is generated. Therefore, our successful integration as ethical and political subjects within a particular community is dependent upon receiving (and conferring) appropriate forms of recognition.

The part of Hegel’s work to lay bare certain fundamental dynamics involved in recognition is the oft-discussed master-slave dialectic which appears in the Phenomenology (see Pinkard, 1996: 46ff; Stern, 2002: 83ff.). Hegel introduces the idea of a ‘struggle for recognition’, describing an encounter between two self-consciousnesses which both seek to affirm the certainty of their being for themselves (Hegel, 1807: 232ff.). Such a conflict is described as a life-and-death struggle, insofar as each consciousness desires to confirm its self-existence and independence through a negation or objectification of the other. That is, it seeks to incorporate the other within its field of consciousness as an object of negation, as something which this consciousness is not, thus affirming its own unfettered existence. Of course, the other also tries to negate this consciousness, thus generating the struggle which results in affirmation of one self-consciousness at the cost of the negation or annihilation of the other. Only in this way, Hegel observes, only by risking life, can freedom be obtained. However, there is a key moment with this struggle. Namely, consciousness realises that it cannot simply destroy the other through incorporating it within itself, for it requires the other as a definite other in order to gain recognition. Thus, it must resist collapsing the other into itself, for to do so would also be to annihilate itself. It would be starving itself of the recognition it requires in order to be a determinate self-consciousness.

Within Hegel’s radical reworking of how the individual subject is understood, autonomy becomes a contingent, social and practical accomplishment; it is an intersubjectively-mediated achievement which is never simply given or guaranteed but always dependent upon our relations with others. This co-dependency results in mutual relations of recognition which are the condition for understanding oneself as a genuinely free being, albeit a free being which acknowledges, and thus adjusts itself, to the freedom of others. Discussing the process of recognition, Hegel (1807: 230) notes that it ‘is absolutely the double process of both self-consciousnesses... Action from one side only would be useless, because what is to happen can only be brought about by means of both’. As a result, these two self-consciousnesses ‘recognize themselves as mutually recognizing one another’ (ibid: 231). Hegel characterises this mutuality, which cannot be coerced but be freely given and received, as being at home in the other. Such a relation with another is the condition for the phenomenological experience of freedom and right. Consequently, our interactions with others are not a limitation on freedom, but rather the ‘enhancement and concrete actualization of freedom’ (Williams, 1997: 59).

We see now how the master-slave dialectic of recognition is inherently unstable and unsatisfying. The master has dominion over the slave, reducing the latter to the status of a mere ‘thing’ through refusing to recognise it as a free and equal self-consciousness. The slave, realising that life as a slave is better than no life at all, accepts this relation of dominance and subservience. Whilst the slave receives no recognition from the master, the master has ‘earned’ the recognition of a slave which it considers as less-than-human. Such recognition is not ‘real’ recognition at all and yet, within this Hegel’s dialectic of recognition, the master requires the recognition of the slave in order to gain some modicum of self-understanding and freedom. The recognition of the slave is ultimately worthless, for it is not the recognition of a free self-consciousness, which alone can grant the recognition on another required for self-certainty of existence and freedom. Trapped in this fruitless relation, the slave becomes the ‘truth’ of the master, and so the master, paradoxically, becomes enslaved to the slave. For Hegel, relations of domination provide a vicious spiral of recognition. They lead nowhere but to their own destruction. Hence recognition must always take place between equals, mediated through social institutions which can guarantee that equality and thus produce the necessary mutual relations of recognition necessary for the attainment of freedom. It is precisely this last point that recent recognition theorists have seized upon and elaborated into comprehensive discussions of justice.

3. Contemporary Theories of Recognition

a. Charles Taylor

Much contemporary interest in recognition was undoubtedly fuelled by Charles Taylor’s essay ‘Multiculturalism and the Politics of Recognition’ (1994), first published in 1992. Taylor’s lucid and concise article is often treated as the classic expression of a theory of recognition. However, it would be more accurate to say that Taylor awoke a general interest in the idea of recognition. His short essay provides a series of reflections and conjectures which, whilst insightful, do not constitute a full-blown theory of recognition. However, its exploratory nature and non-technical language has helped install it as the common reference point for discussions of recognition.

Taylor begins with the assertion that ‘a number of strands in contemporary politics turn on the need, sometimes the demand, for recognition’ (Taylor, 1994: 25). He identifies such a demand as present in the political activities of feminism, race movements and multiculturalists (for a critical discussion of this point, see Nicholson, 1996). The specific importance of recognition lies in its relationship to identity, which he defines as ‘a person’s understanding of who they are, of their fundamental characteristics as a human being’ (Taylor, 1994: 25). Because identity is ‘partly shaped by recognition or its absence’, then ‘Nonrecognition or misrecognition can inflict harm, can be a form of oppression, imprisoning someone in a false, distorted, and reduced mode of being’ (ibid.). Underlying Taylor’s model is the Hegelian belief that individuals are formed intersubjectively (see Section II). Our individual identity is not constructed from within and generated by each of us alone. Rather, it is through dialogue with others that we negotiate our identity. Taylor refers to these others as ‘significant others’, meaning those people who have an important role in our lives (that is, family, friends, teachers, colleagues, and so forth.). The idea that our sense of who we are is determined through our interaction with others initiates a shift from a monologic to a dialogic model of the self.

Taylor is keen to stress just how important recognition is, referring to it as ‘a vital human need’ (ibid: 26) and stating that misrecognition ‘can inflict a grievous wound, saddling its victims with a crippling self-hatred’ (ibid: 26). Deploying a brief historical narrative, Taylor argues that the collapse of social hierarchies, which had provided the basis for bestowing honour on certain individuals (that is, those high up on the social ladder), led to the modern day notion of dignity, which rests upon universalist and egalitarian principles regarding the equal worth of all human beings. This notion of dignity lies at the core of contemporary democratic ideals, unlike the notion of honour which is, he claims, clearly incompatible with democratic culture. This picture is complicated by the fact that alongside this development of dignity there emerged also a new understanding of ‘individualised identity’, one in which the emphasis was on each person’s uniqueness, which Taylor defines as ‘being true to myself and my own particular way of being’ (ibid: 28). Taylor refers to this idea of uniqueness as the ideal of authenticity, writing ‘Being true to myself means being true to my own originality, which is something only I can articulate and discover. In articulating it, I am also defining myself’ (ibid: 31).

Taylor has been accused of adopting an essentialist view of the self, on the basis that there is some inner ‘me’ waiting to be uncovered and displayed to (recognised by) the world (see section V. b). However, he is quick to point out that the discovery of our authenticity is not simply a matter of introspection. Rather, it is through our interactions with others that we define who we are. Nor is there an end point to this dialogue. It continues throughout our entire lives and does not even depend upon the physical presence of a specific other for that person to influence us. Consider, for example, the way an imaginary conversation with a deceased partner might influence how we act or view ourselves. The importance of recognition lies precisely in the fact that how others see (might) us is a necessary step in forming an understanding of who we are. To be recognised negatively, or misrecognised, is to be thwarted in our desire for authenticity and self-esteem.

Taylor’s uses these insights to construct a politics of equal recognition. He identifies two different ways in which the idea of equal recognition has been understood. The first is a politics of equal dignity, or a politics of universalism, which aims at the equalisation of all rights and entitlements. In this instance, all individuals are to be treated as universally the same through recognition of their common citizenship or humanity. The second formulation is the politics of difference, in which the uniqueness of each individual or group is recognised. Rousseau bitterly noted that man, having shifted from a state of self-sufficiency and simplicity to one of competition and domination that characterises modern society, has come to crave the recognition of their difference (Rousseau, 1754). In this detrimental situation, man is rendered dependent upon the views of others, craving what Rousseau termed ‘amour propre’ through the admiration of those around him, leading to an endless competition for greater achievements and respect and thus robbing man of his independence. For Rousseau, this desire for individual distinction, achievement and recognition conflicts with a principle of equal respect

Returning to Taylor, he notes that there is also a universal basis to this second political model insofar as all people are entitled to have their identity recognised: ‘we give due acknowledgement only to what is universally present – everyone has an identity – through recognizing what is peculiar to each. The universal demand powers an acknowledgement of specificity’ (Taylor, 1994: 39). One consequence of this politics of difference is that certain rights will be assigned to specific groups but not others. The two approaches can be summed as follows. The politics of equal dignity is difference-blind, whereas the politics of difference is, as the name suggests, difference-friendly (this does not mean that a politics of equal dignity is not also ‘friendly’ towards difference, but rather that differences between individuals cannot be the normative foundation for the assignment of certain rights or entitlement to some individuals or groups but not others).

Taylor defends a politics of difference, arguing that the concept of equal dignity often (if not always) derives its idea of what rights and entitlement are worth having from the perspective of the hegemonic culture, thus enforcing minority groups to conform to the expectations of dominant culture and hence relinquish their particularity. Failure to conform will result in the minority culture being derided and ostracised by the dominant culture. As Taylor (ibid: 66) notes, ‘dominant groups tend to entrench their hegemony by inculcating an image of inferiority in the subjugated’. A clear instance of this can be seen in de Beauvoir’s claim that woman is always defined as man’s ‘other’ or ‘shadow’ (de Beauvoir, 1949). Woman exists as a lack; characterised through what she does not possess or exhibit (namely, male and masculine traits). Similarly, civil rights movements have frequently protested that the image of the ‘human’ was inevitably white, Western, educated, middle-class and wealthy. An example of how this plays out in everyday life is the recent, though now generally discarded, practice of labelling pink crayons ‘flesh’ coloured. Both feminist and race theorists have tried to convey the idea that the white male is simply another particular instance of humanity, rather than its ‘default’ image or constitutive, universal norm. This point was strongly made by Fanon (1952), who detailed how racism infiltrates the consciousness of the oppressed, preventing psychological health through the internalisation of subjection and otherness. This in turn alienates the black person from both their society and their own body, owing to the fact that the world is defined in terms of ‘whiteness’ and thus as something essentially irretrievably different (alien) to them.

b. Axel Honneth

Axel Honneth has produced arguably the most extensive discussion of recognition to date. He is in agreement with Taylor that recognition is essential to self-realisation. However, he draws more explicitly on Hegelian intersubjectivity in order to identify the mechanics of how this is achieved, as well as establishing the motivational and normative role recognition can play in understanding and justifying social movements. Following Hegel (1807; 1821) and Mead (1934), Honneth identifies three ‘spheres of interaction’ which are connected to the three ‘patterns of recognition’ necessary for an individual’s development of a positive relation-to-self.  These are love, rights, and solidarity (Honneth, 1995: 92ff; also Honneth 2007, 129-142).

The mode of recognition termed ‘love’ refers to our physical needs and emotions being met by others and takes the form of our primary relationships (that is, close friends, family and lovers). It provides a basic self-confidence, which can be shattered through physical abuse.  The mode of recognition termed ‘rights’ refers to the development of moral responsibility, developed through our moral relations with others. It is a mutual mode of recognition ‘in which the individual learns to see himself from the perspective of his [or her] partner in interaction as a bearer of equal rights’ (Honneth, 1992: 194). The denial of rights through social and legal exclusion can threaten one’s sense of being a fully active, equal and respected member of society. Finally, the mode of recognition termed ‘solidarity’ relates to recognition of our traits and abilities. It is essential for developing our self-esteem and for how we become ‘individualised’, for it is precisely our personal traits and abilities that define our personal difference (Honneth, 1995: 122). Consequently, unlike the relations of love and rights, which express universal features of human subjects, esteem ‘demands a social medium that must be able to express the characteristic differences between human subjects in a universal, and more specifically, intersubjectively obligatory way’ (ibid.). All three spheres of recognition are crucial to developing a positive attitude towards oneself:

For it is only due to the cumulative acquisition of basic self-confidence, of self-respect, and of self-esteem... that a person can come to see himself or herself, unconditionally, as both an autonomous and an individuated being and to identify with his or her goals and desires (ibid: 169).

According to Honneth, the denial of recognition provides the motivational and justificatory basis for social struggles. Specifically, it is through the emotional experiences generated by certain attitudes and actions of others towards us that we can come to feel we are being illegitimately denied social recognition. This argument makes use of Dewey’s theory of emotion as intentionally orientated. Certain emotional states, such as shame, anger and frustration, are generated by the failure of our actions. Conversely, more positive emotional states are generated through successful action. The experience of negative emotional states can, in theory, reveal to us that an injustice is taking place (namely, that we are not being given due and appropriate recognition). However, as Honneth points out, feelings of shame or anger need not (indeed, do not) necessarily disclose relations of disrespect (ibid: 138). What they provide is the potential for identifying the occurrence of an injustice which one is justified in opposing. The experience of disrespect is the raw material from which normatively justified social struggles can be formulated. Furthermore, it is only within certain social contexts, those in which the ‘means of articulation of a social movement are available’ (ibid: 139), that experiences of disrespect provide the motivational basis for political struggles (see Honneth, 2007). Presumably, disrespect in other contexts would lead to individual acts of retaliation or undirected violence, rather than coordinated resistance.

This phenomenological approach to recognition thus locates the source and justification of social struggles in the experiences and expectations of recognition. Of course, as noted, it requires the further steps of (a) locating these experiences within a socially-generated framework of emancipatory discourse; and (b) the establishment of common experiences amongst individuals for these individual frustrations to develop into social struggles. Therefore, it would be naïve to think that Honneth is blind to the importance of, say, ensuring the means and rights to collective political action within societies. But the fundamental component of any attempt to identify injustice and vindicate the necessary remedies must be located in the individual’s experiences of disrespect (Honneth, 2007) (for a potential problem with this position, see Rogers, 2009).

In order to justify these claims, Honneth ascribes an inherent expectation of recognition to humans, referring to demands generated from such an expectation as the ‘“quasi-transcendental interests” of the human race’ (Fraser and Honneth, 2003: 174). It is only through the failure of such expectations that recognition can be a motivational source, arising via negative emotional experiences. This assumption allows Honneth to assess societal change as a developmental process driven by moral claims arising from experiences of disrespect. Honneth (1995: 168) summarises his somewhat teleological account (a product of Honneth’s Hegelian and Aristotelian tendencies) as follows: ‘Every unique, historical struggle or conflict only reveals its position within the development of society once its role in the establishment of moral progress, in terms of recognition, has been grasped’.

The positing of an approximate and ideal end-state, presumably one in which full recognition reigns supreme, allows a distinction between progressive, emancipatory struggles and those which are reactionary and / or oppressive. Therefore, from this general position of enabling the self-realisation of one’s desires, characteristics and abilities, we can assess current socio-political struggles and analyse their future directions so as to ensure their promoting of the conditions for self-realisation. Honneth is careful to specify that he is not advocating a single, substantive set of universal values and social arrangements. Rather, his concept of ‘the good’ is concerned with the ‘structural elements of ethical life’ which enable personal integrity (ibid: 172). Therefore, the posited ‘end-point’ from which normative claims can be made must emanate from structural relations outlined in the three distinct patterns of recognition which foster a positive relation-to-self (for a discussion of Honneth’s conception of the good / ethical life, see Zurn, 2000). Here, Honneth is trying to retain a Kantian notion of respect and autonomy through identifying the necessary conditions for self-realisation and self-determination, akin to a Kantian kingdom of ends in which all individuals receive and confer recognition on one another. Simultaneously, in stressing the minimal or ‘bare’ conditions necessary for this, he aims to avoid committing himself to a singular, substantial conception of the good life and thus resists the dangers of reproducing an exclusivist and exclusionary conception of what constitutes the good life.

c. Nancy Fraser

Whereas there are broad areas of agreement between Honneth and Taylor, Nancy Fraser is keen to differentiate her theory of recognition from both of their respective positions. Fraser’s overarching theme throughout her works on recognition is the dissolving of the assumed antithesis between redistribution and recognition (arguably this assumption is a consequence of critical theory’s Marxist roots, within which framework Fraser’s work undoubtedly emerges from). Thus far, the presentation of recognition and redistribution has been presented (at least implicitly) as an either/or decision. Fraser believes that this binary opposition derives from the fact that, whereas recognition seems to promote differentiation, redistribution supposedly works to eliminate it. The recognition paradigm seems to target cultural injustice, which is rooted in the way people’s identities are positively or negatively valued. Individuals exist as members of a community based upon a shared horizon of meanings, norms and values. Conversely, the distribution paradigm targets economic injustice, which is rooted in one’s relation to the market or the means of production (Fraser and Honneth, 2003: 14). Here, individuals exist in a hierarchically-differentiated collective class system which, from the perspective of the majority class who are constituted by a lack of resources, needs abolishing.

According to Fraser, both these forms of injustice are primary and co-original, meaning that economic inequality cannot be reduced to cultural misrecognition, and vice-versa. Many social movements face this dilemma of having to balance the demand for (economic) equality with the insistence that their (cultural) specificity be met. Fraser (1997: 19) gives the example of the feminist movement by posing the question, ‘How can feminists fight simultaneously to abolish gender differentiation [through economic redistribution] and to valorize gender specificity [through cultural recognition]?’. There is a clear divergence here between the monistic models of Taylor and Honneth, in which recognition is the foundational category of social analysis and distribution is treated as derivative, and Fraser’s dualistic model. Whereas Honneth thinks a sufficiently elaborated concept of recognition can do all the work needed for a critical theory of justice, Fraser argues that recognition is but one dimension of justice, albeit a vitally important one.

The disagreement over whether or not distribution can be made to supervene on recognition arises from the differing interpretations of recognition. According to Fraser (Fraser and Honneth 2003: 29), one can understand recognition as either (a) a matter of justice, connected to with the concept of a universal ‘right’ (Fraser’s position); or (b) a matter of self-realisation, connected with historically-relative cultural conceptions of the ‘good’ (Honneth’s and Taylor’s position). In (b) Fraser draws out the Aristotelian idea of eudaimonia (flourishing), which runs throughout Honneth’s teleological account. Contra Honneth and Taylor, Fraser does not look to situate the injustice of misrecognition in the retardation of personal development. Rather, she identifies it with the fact that ‘some individuals and groups are denied the status of full partners in social interaction simply as a consequence of institutionalized patterns of cultural value in whose construction they have not equally participated and which disparage their distinctive characteristics or the distinctive characteristics assigned to them’ (ibid). Addressing injustices arising from misrecognition therefore means looking at the discursive representations of identities in order to identity how certain individuals are assigned a relatively inferior social standing. Hence, on Fraser’s model, misrecognition should not be construed as an impediment to ethical self-realization (as it is for Taylor and Honneth). Instead, it should be conceived as an institutionalised relation of subordination.

Owing to her identification of recognition with social status, the evaluative element in Fraser’s account is the notion of ‘parity of participation’. According to this principle, ‘justice requires that social arrangements permit all (adult) members of society to interact with one another as peer’ (ibid: 36). In effect, recognition is required in order to guarantee that all members of society have an equal participation in social life. Crucially, participatory parity also requires material / economic redistribution in order to guarantee that people are independent and ‘have a voice’ (ibid). Because Honneth equates recognition with self-realisation, the derivative issues of redistribution are only generated to the extent that they inhibit this personal development. For Fraser, injustice in the form of both misrecognition and maldistribution is detrimental to the extent that it inhibits participatory parity.

Fraser considers two possible remedies for injustice, which transcend the redistribution-recognition divide by being applicable to both. The first is ‘affirmation’, which incorporates any action which corrects ‘inequitable outcomes of social arrangements without disturbing the underlying framework that generates them’ (ibid: 23). The second is ‘transformation’, which refers to ‘remedies aimed at correcting inequitable outcomes precisely by restricting the underlying generative framework’ (ibid). Fraser’s concept of transformation highlights her belief that certain forms of injustice are ingrained within ‘institutionalized patterns of cultural value’ (ibid: 46). Certain forms of inequality, including those of race and gender, derive from the signifying effect of socio-cultural structures. These discursive frameworks, situated within language and social arrangements, reproduce hierarchical binary oppositions such as ‘heterosexual/homosexual’, ‘white/black’ and ‘man/woman’. Thus, the solution is not simply a matter of revaluing heterosexual, female or black identities. Rather, one must attempt to deconstruct the binary logic which situates people as inherently inferior, creating a ‘field of multiple, debinarized, fluid, ever-shifting differences’ (Fraser, 1997: 24). One key aspect of this transformative approach is that, unlike the affirmative approach which aims to alter only one particular group’s sense of worth or material situation, it would change everyone’s sense of self. The proposal made by Fraser, then, is the radical restructuring of society, achieved through transformative redistribution (that is, socialism) and recognition (cultural deconstruction). It should be noted that in her more recent work on recognition (that is, Fraser 2000; 2001), she resists offering any particular remedies, arguing instead that the required response to injustice will be dictated by the specific context. Thus, she appears to distance herself from the more ‘deconstructive’ elements of her earlier work (see Zurn, 2003).

4. Redistribution or Recognition? The Fraser-Honneth Debate

In a very important discussion, Fraser and Honneth (2003) defend their respective theories of recognition (see also Honneth, 2001). Underlying the disagreements between them is their respective positions regarding the distribution / recognition debate. As noted in Section III, Fraser believes that recognition and distribution are two irreducible elements of a satisfactory theory of justice. This is to say, they are of equal foundational importance – the one cannot be collapsed into the other. Honneth, on the other hand, contends that issues of distribution are ultimately explained and justified through issues of recognition. As he writes, ‘questions of distributive justice are better understood in terms of normative categories that come from a sufficiently differentiated theory of recognition’ (ibid: 126). He begins justifying this claim through a historical survey of political movements and unrest amongst the lower classes during the early stages of capitalism. What marked such activities was the commonly held belief that the honour and dignity of the members of the lower classes were not being adequately respected. Summarising these findings, Honneth (ibid: 132) proclaims that ‘subjects perceive institutional procedures as social injustice when they see aspects of their personality being disrespected which they believe they have a right to recognition’.

One important consequence of this view is that it undermines the received wisdom that collective identity movements are a recent ‘modern’ phenomenon. In actual fact, according to Honneth, experiences of disrespect and denigration of an individual’s or group’s identity are the constitutive feature of all instances of social discontent. Portraying ‘recognition’ as the sole preserve of cultural minorities struggling for social respect is therefore highly misleading and obscures the fact that challenges to the existing social order are always driven by the moral experience of failing to receive what is deemed to be sufficient recognition (ibid: 160). Any dispute regarding redistribution of wealth or resources is reducible to a claim over the social valorisation of specific group or individual traits. The feminist struggle over the gendered division of labour is, according to Honneth, primarily a struggle regarding the prevailing assessment of achievement and worth which has had important redistributive effects, such as a trend towards greater access to, and equality within, the workplace and the acknowledgement of ‘female’ housework. The division that Fraser makes between economic distribution and cultural recognition is, Honneth claims, an arbitrary and ultimately misleading one that ignores the fundamental role played by recognition in economic struggles, as well as implying that the cultural sphere of society can be understood as functioning independently of the economic sphere.

Fraser (ibid: 30ff.) offers four advantages of her status model over Honneth’s monistic vision of justice as due recognition (for a discussion of these, see Zurn, 2003). Arguably the most important of these is that, in locating injustice in social relations governed by cultural patterns of representations, she can move beyond both Taylor’s and Honneth’s reliance on psychology as the normative force underlying struggles for recognition. Recalling that Honneth locates the experiences of injustice in the emotional responses to frustrated expectations of due recognition, Fraser argues that she is able to ‘show that a society whose institutionalized norms impede parity of participation is morally indefensible whether or not they distort the subjectivity of the oppressed’ (ibid: 32). The ideal of participatory parity gives Fraser her normative component, for it provides the basis on which different recognition claims can be judged. Namely, a valid recognition claim is one in which subjects can show that ‘institutionalized patterns of cultural value deny them the necessary intersubjective conditions [for participatory parity]’ (ibid: 38). Honneth’s invocation of pre-political suffering, generated by the perceived withholding of recognition, as the motivating force behind social movements is thus rejected by Fraser as seriously problematic. In particular, she says, the idea that all social discontent has the same, single underlying motivation (misrecognition) is simply implausible. Honneth rejects other motivational factors such as ‘resentment of unearned privilege, abhorrence of cruelty, aversion of arbitrary power... antipathy to exploitation, dislike of supervision’ that cannot not simply be reduced down to, or subsumed by, an overarching expectation of appropriate recognition.

Another problem with Honneth’s psychological model of experiences of injustice is that, so Fraser argues, it shifts the focus away from society and onto the self, thus ‘implanting an excessively personalized sense of injury’ (ibid: 204). This can lead to the victim of oppression internalising the injustice or blaming themselves, rather than the discursive and material conditions within which they are situated as oppressed or harmed. Indeed, Fraser proceeds to point out that there can be no ‘pure’ experience of moral indignation caused by withheld or inappropriate recognition. There is no realm of personal experience that is not experienced through a particular linguistic and historical horizon, which actively shapes the experience in question (see section V. d). Thus to introduce a ‘primordial’ sense of moral suffering is, Fraser claims, simply incoherent (similar concerns are raised by McNay, 2008: 138ff.). Honneth cannot invoke psychological experiences of disrespect as the normative foundation for his theory of recognition as they cannot be treated as independent of the discursive conditions within which the subject is constituted. To do so is to rely on an ultimately unjustifiable transcendental account of the subject’s access to their sense of moral worth grounded in the right to recognition.

In his response to Fraser, Honneth points out that she can necessarily focus only on those social movements that have already become visible. By analysing the ways in which individuals and groups are socially-situated by institutionalised patterns of cultural value, Fraser limits herself to only those expressions of social discontent that have already entered the public sphere. The logic of this criticism seems to be that, if (in)justice is a matter of how society signifies subjects’ abilities and characteristics, then it can only address those collective subjectivities which are currently socially recognised. In other words, there could be a plethora of individuals and groups who are struggling for recognition which have not yet achieved public acknowledgement and thus have not been implicated within positive or negative social structures of signification. There appears some weight to this criticism, for a successful critical social theory should be able to not only critique the status quo, but identify future patterns of social resistance. If, on Fraser's account, justice is a matter of addressing how subjects are socially-situated by existing value structures, then it seems to lack the conceptual apparatus to look beyond the present. The ability to identify social discontent must, Honneth argues, be constructed independently of social recognition, and therefore ‘requires precisely the kind of moral-psychological considerations Fraser seeks to avoid’ (ibid: 125). In ignoring the individual’s experiences of injustice as the disrespect of aspects of their personality, a social theory can only address the present situation, rather than exploring the normative directions of future social struggles. It is out of the frustration of individual expectations of due recognition that new social movements will emanate, rather than the pre-existing patterns of signification which currently hierarchically situate subjects.

5. Criticisms of Recognition

Despite its influence and popularity, there are a number of concerns regarding the concept of recognition as a foundational element in a theory of justice. This article cannot hope to present an exhaustive list, so instead offers a few of the most common critiques.

a. The Reification of Identity

Perhaps the one most frequently voiced criticism is that regarding the reification of group identity. Put simply, the concern is that, in initiating an identity politics in which one demands positive recognition for a group’s specific characteristics, specific characteristics can be seen as necessarily constitutive of this group and thus any group member who does not display these characteristics risks being ostracised. Such claims are often cloaked in a language of ‘authenticity’ which leads to demands for conformity amongst individual members of the group in order to gain acceptance and approval. This risks producing intergroup coercion and enforcing conformity at the expense of individual specificity.

To give an example, discussed by Appiah (1994) in his response to Taylor’s essay on recognition, the construction of a black politics in which black identity is celebrated can provide a sense of self-worth and dignity amongst historically denigrated black communities. However, it can also lead to a ‘proper’ way of being black, one which all members of the black community must demonstrate in order to partake in this positive self-image. Such expectations of behaviour can lead, Appiah notes (ibid: 163), to one form of tyranny being replaced by another. Specifically, individuals who fail to exemplify authentic ‘black’ identity can find themselves once again the victims of intolerance and social exclusion. Similar dynamics of exclusion can be seen in the debate within certain feminist circles about whether lesbians can be properly considered ‘women’. Extrapolating from these concerns, Markell (2003) argues that Taylor conflates individual identity with group identity with the result that agency is rendered a matter of adopting the identity one is assigned through membership of one's community. Consequently, the critical tension between the individual and community is dissolved, which leaves little (if any) space for critiquing or resisting the dominant norms and values of one's community (see also Habermas, 1991: 271).

The reification of group identity can also lead to separatism through generating an ‘us-and-them’ group mentality. By valorising a particular identity, those other identities which lack certain characteristics particular to the group in question can be dismissed as inferior. This isolationist policy runs counter to the ideal of social acceptability and respect for difference that a politics of recognition is meant to initiate. Reifying group identity prevents critical dialogue taking place either within or between groups. Internal group members who challenge apparently ‘authentic’ aspects of their culture or group identity can be labelled as traitors, whilst non-group members are dismissed as unqualified to comment on the characteristics of the group on the basis that they are ‘outsiders’. The result is a strong separatism and radical relativism in which intergroup dialogue is eliminated. This can mask over the ways in which various axes of identity overlap and thus ignores the commonalities between groups. For example, the focus of black feminists on ‘black culture’ and the oppression this has suffered can lead to a failure to recognise their commonality with women in other cultures. Conversely, the tendency among feminists to focus on the concept of ‘woman’ can lead them to ignore the potential alliances they might share with other oppressed groups that don’t focus on gender injustice. Underlying this critique is the idea that identity is always multilayered and that each individual is always positioned at the intersection of multiple axes of oppression. Simply reducing one’s sense of oppression to a single feature of identity (such as race or gender) fails to acknowledge the way that each feature of identity is inextricably bound up with other features, so that, for example, race and gender cannot be treated as analytically distinct modes of dominance.

b. The Accusation of Essentialism

Similar to the concerns over reification, there is a concern that recognition theories invoke an essentialist account of identity. This has particularly been the case with regards Taylor’s model of recognition (see McNay, 2008: 64ff). Critics accuse recognition theory of assuming that there is a kernel of selfhood that awaits recognition (see, for example, Heyes, 2003). The struggle for recognition thus becomes a struggle to be recognised as what one truly is. This implies that certain features of a person lie dormant, awaiting discovery by the individual who then presents this authentic self to the world and demands positive recognition for it. Although Taylor is keen to stress that his model is not committed to such an essentialist account of the self, certain remarks he makes do not help his cause. For example, in describing the modern view of how we create a sense of ‘full being’, he notes that, rather than connecting with some source outside of ourselves (such as God or the Platonic Good), ‘the source we have to connect with is deep within us. This fact is part of the massive subjective turn of modern culture, a new form of inwardness, in which we come to think our ourselves as beings with hidden depths’ (Taylor, 1994: 29). Taylor proceeds to note that ‘Being true to myself means being true to my own originality, which is something only I can articulate and discover’ (ibid: 31) and that authenticity ‘calls on me to discover my own original way of being. By definition, this way of being cannot be socially derived, but must be inwardly generated’ (ibid: 32).

A more radical account of intersubjectivity can be found in Arendt (1958). Examining the processes by which the subject reveals who they are, she shifts the focus away from a personal revelation on the part of the agent and into the social realm: ‘it is more than likely that the “who” , which appears so clearly and unmistakably to others, remains hidden from the person itself, like the daimōn in Greek religion which accompanies each man throughout his life, always looking over his shoulder from behind and thus visible only to those he encounters’ (Arendt, 1958: 179-80). One important consequence of this idea is that, in order to address the question of ‘who’ we are, we must be willing to relinquish control of any such answer. In so doing, we place ourselves into the hands of others. As Arendt writes, ‘This unpredictability of outcome [of personal disclosure] is closely related to the revelatory character of action and speech, in which one discloses one’s self without ever either knowing himself or being able to calculate beforehand whom he reveals’ (ibid: 192) (for an Arendt-inspired critique of recognition, see Markell, 2003).

c. The Danger of Subjectivism

Taylor mitigates his position and, arguably, eschews any form of essentialism, by arguing that we always work out our identity through dialogue with others. However, there is a possibility that he slips towards a subjectivist position, for it seems that it is the individual who ultimately decides what their ‘true’ identity is. For example, Taylor (1994: 32-3) states that this dialogue with others requires that we struggle with and sometimes struggle against the things that others want to see in us. However, he does not state to what we appeal to in this potential struggle with others. If it is ultimately our sense of who we are, then this would seem to undermine the very conditions of intersubjectivity that Taylor wants to introduce into the notion of personal identity. For, if one is the ultimate judge and jury on who one is, then those around us will simply be agreeing or disagreeing with our pre-existent or inwardly-generated sense of self, rather than playing an ineliminable role in its constitution.

Again, it is unlikely that Taylor would endorse any form of subjectivism. Indeed, his turn towards intersubjective recognition is precisely meant to resist the idea that one simply decides who one is and demands that others recognise oneself in such a way. Taylor would certainly seem critical of the existential tradition, which emphasised the need for one to define oneself and provide meaning to the world. Although Sartre deployed the language of intersubjectivity (see V. d) and highlighted the importance of the other, his analysis of the in-itself and the for-itself, coupled with describing how we are each born alone and must carry the weight of the world on our shoulders (with no-one able to lighten the burden), suggests an ego which negates (and hence is radically separated from) the world. This split between ‘I’ and ‘you’ renders any notion of dialogical identity construction impotent.

Recognition, contrasted with this existential picture, theories seem well equipped to resist any accusation that they slide into subjectivism. However, they must provide a criterion from which to judge whether individual and collective demands for recognition are legitimate. For example, it cannot be the case that all demands for recognition are accepted, for we are unlikely to want to recognise the claims of a racist or homophobic group for cultural protection. There is a danger that Taylor’s model does not explicitly state the conditions by which acceptable claims for recognition can be separated from unacceptable claims. His politics of difference is premised on ‘a universal respect for the human capacity to form one’s identity (Taylor, 1994: 42). Hence he seems committed to respecting difference qua difference, regardless of the particular form this difference takes. There is a sense that, as long as recourse is made to an ‘authentic’ life, then the demand for recognition should be met. But no matter how strongly the racist group insists upon their authenticity, we would be likely to resist recognising the value and worth of their identity as racists.

d. The Problem of the Other

Certain theorists have tended to cast recognition in a far more negative, conflictual light. Typically, they interpret Hegelian recognition as evolving an inescapable element of domination between, or appropriation of, subjects. Perhaps the most notable of such thinkers is Sartre (1943), whose account of intersubjectivity appears to preclude any possibility of recognition functioning as a means of attaining political solidarity or emancipation. According to Sartre, our relations with other people are always conflictual as each of us attempts to negate the other in an intersubjective dual. The realisation of our own subjectivity is dependent upon our turning the other into an object. In turn, we are made to feel like an object within the gaze of the other. Sartre’s famous example is the shameful, objectifying experience of suddenly feeling the ‘look’ or ‘gaze’ of another person upon us when carrying out a contemptible act. In this moment of shame, I feel myself as an object and am thus denied existence as a subject. My only hope is to make the other into an object. There are no equal or stable relations between people; all interactions are processes of domination.

Whereas Sartre focuses on the problem of being recognised, Levinas (1961) turns to the ethical issues attending how one recognises others. According to Levinas, Hegelian recognition involves an unavoidable appropriation or assimilation of the other into one’s own subjectivity. By this he means that in recognising the other we render them ‘knowable’ according to our own terms, thus depriving him or her of their irreducible ‘alterity’ or difference. Levinas believes that the denying of such difference is the fundamental ethical sin as it fails to respect the other in their absolute exteriority, their absolute difference to us. In effect, to recognise someone is to render them the same as us; to eliminate their inescapable, unapprehendable and absolute alterity (Yar, 2002).

An alternative perspective on the self-other relationship can be found in Merleau-Ponty who argues that the other is always instigated within oneself, and vice-versa, through the potential reversibility of the self-other dichotomy (that is, that the self is also a potential other; seeing someone necessarily involves the possibility of being seen). Merleau-Ponty explicitly rejects the Levinasian perspective that the other is an irreducible alterity. Rather, the self and other are intertwined through their bodily imbrications in the world. He describes our respective perspectives on the world as slipping into one another and thus being brought together: ‘In reality, the other is not shut up inside my perspective of the world, because this perspective itself has no definite limits, because it slips spontaneously into the other’s’ (Merleau-Ponty, 1945: 411). Consequently, there is no ‘problem’ of the other, for the other is already contained within our being, as we are within theirs. This resonates with Heidegger’s characterisation of Being (Dasein) as being-with-others. We are always already alongside others, bound up in relations of mutuality that prevent any strict ontological distinction between self, other and world.

The Levinasian and Sartrean accounts of the self-other relationship can be criticised from a hermeneutic perspective for failing to acknowledge the fact that understanding is essentially a conversation with another, and that a simple reduction of the other to a sameness with oneself, or a pure objectification of the other, would preclude the possibility of a genuine interaction from which mutual understanding could arise (Gadamer, 1960). Levinas presents a monological account of understanding, ignoring the fundamentally dialogical nature of intersubjectivity. As Taylor (1994: 67) approvingly noted, understanding according to Gadamer is always a fusion of horizons, a coming-to-understanding between two individuals who require the perspective of the other in order to make sense of their own (and vice-versa). Neither the total incorporation of the other into the perspective of the recognisee, nor the reduction of the other to pure object, is possible on a hermeneutic account of meaning and understanding.

e. The Post-Structural Challenge

Concurrent with the rise of identity politics, there has been a trend towards ‘deconstructive’ or ‘destabilising’ accounts of the individual subject. Rather than representing a single critical perspective on recognition and identity politics, the post-structural challenge can be understood as a broad term incorporating various attempts at showing how the subject is always constructed through and within networks of power and discourse (e.g. Foucault, 1980; Butler, 1990; Haraway 1991; Lloyd, 2005; McNay, 2008).

Perhaps the most notable theorist in this regard is Foucault, who develops a detailed account of the way in which the subject is constituted through discursive relations of power. Within Foucault’s theory, the individual becomes the ‘site’ where power is enacted (and, importantly, resisted or reworked). Foucault’s genealogical method was employed precisely in order to explore the conditions under which we, as subjects, exist and what causes us to exist in the way that we do. According to Foucault, not only are we controlled by truth and power, we are created by it too. Concerning his genealogical method, Foucault (1980: 117) writes, ‘One has to dispense with the constituent subject, to get rid of the subject itself, that’s to say, to arrive at an analysis which can account for the constitution of the subject within a historical framework’. This leads to a far more problematic view of the subject than is generally found within recognition theories. Specifically, issues of power, coercion and oppression are seen as coeval with identity formation and intersubjective relations.

This suggests that there can be no instances of mutual recognition that do not simultaneously transmit and reproduce relations of power. As Foucault (1988: 39) notes, ‘If I tell the truth about myself... it is in part that I am constituted as a subject across a number of power relations which are exerted over me and which I exert over others’. Critics of recognition theorists argue that they ignore the fundamental relationship between power and identity formation, assuming instead that intersubjective relations can be established which are not mediated through power relations. McNay (2008) develops this critique through a discussion of Bourdieu’s concept of habitus, arguing that Taylor assumes that language is an expressive medium that functions independently of, and antecedent to, power and thus fails to analyse how ‘self-expression is constitutively shaped by power relations’ (ibid: 69).

Another important theorist in this regard is Judith Butler, whose account of gender identity develops certain key themes of Foucauldian theory as well as insights offered up by Derrida on the re-iteration of norms as fundamental to identity formation. Butler (1988: 519) begins outlining this project by arguing that gender is ‘in no way a stable identity or locus of agency from which various acts proceed; rather it is an identity tenuously constituted in time – an identity instituted through a stylized repetition of acts’. Gender is created through acts which are ‘internally discontinuous’. These acts produce the ‘appearance of substance’, but this apparition is no more than ‘a constructed identity, a performative accomplishment which the mundane social audience, including the actors themselves, come to believe and to perform in the mode of belief’ (ibid: 520; see also Butler 1990: 141). Essentially, we internalise a set of discursive practices which enforce conformity to a set of idealised and constructed accounts of gender identity that reinforce heterosexual, patriarchal assumptions about what a man and woman is meant to be like.

Turning the commonsense view of gender on its head, Butler argues that the various acts, thoughts and physical appearances which we take to arise from our gender are actually the very things which produce our sense of gender. Gender is the consequence, rather than the cause, of these individual, isolated, norm-governed acts. Because acts which constitute gender are governed by institutional norms which enforce certain modes of behaviour, thought, speech, and even shape our bodies, all positive constructions of gender categories will be exclusionary. Consequently, not only does Butler deny any ontological justification for a feminist identity politics, but she also rejects the possibility of a political justification. Identity categories ‘are never merely descriptive, but always normative, and as such, exclusionary’ (1992: 16). As a result, ‘Any effort to give universal content or specific content to the category of women... will necessarily produce factionalization’ and so, ‘“identity” as a point of departure can never hold as the solidifying ground of a feminist political movement’ (ibid: 15).

Infusing issues of power into the recognition debate therefore presents problems for existent models of recognition. Taken to its extreme, contemporary feminist accounts of gender and identity may be seen as reason to decisively reject recognition politics. If, as Butler suggests, gender identity is intrinsically connected to power, then to demand recognition for one’s identity could seen as becoming compliant with existing power structures. Such a position would have no possibility of radically critiquing the status quo and would thus potentially forfeit any emancipatory promise. Upon the relationship between the individual and power, Foucault (1980: 98) writes: ‘[Individuals] are not only its [power’s] intent or consenting target; they are always also the elements of its articulation. In other words, individuals are the vehicles of power, not its point of application’. The concern is that there is no form of self-realisation in recognition models that does not, in some way, reproduce patterns of dominance or exclusion.

6. The Future of Recognition

Despite the above reservations regarding the concept of recognition and its political application, there is a growing interest in the value of recognition as a normative socio-political principle. The increasingly multicultural nature of societies throughout the world seems to call for a political theory which places respect for difference at its core. In this regard, recognition theories seem likely to only increase in influence. It should also be noted that they are very much in their infancy. It was only in the 1990s that theorists formulated a comprehensive account of recognition as a foundational concept within theories of justice. To this extent, they are still in the process of being fashioned and re-evaluated in the light of critical assessment from various schools of thought.

For many thinkers, the concept of recognition captures a fundamental feature of human subjectivity. It draws attention to the vital importance of our social interactions in formulating our sense of identity and self-worth as well as revealing the underlying motivations for, and justifications of, political action. It seems particularly useful in making sense of notions of authenticity and the conditions for agency, as well as mapping out the conditions for rational responsibility and authority (see Brandom, 2009). As a result, recognition can be seen as an indispensible means for analysing social movements, assessing claims for justice, thinking through issues of equality and difference, understanding our concrete relations to others, and explicating the nature of personal identity. Although there remain concerns regarding various aspects of recognition as a social and political concept, it is entirely possible that many of these will be addressed and resolved through future research.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Alexander, Jeffrey C. and Lara, Maria P., ‘Honneth’s New Critical Theory of Recognition’. New Left Review. 1/220 (1996): 126-136
  • Appiah, Kwame, A. ‘Identity, Authenticity, Survival: Multicultural Societies and Social Reproduction’. Multiculturalism: Examining the Politics of Recognition. Ed. Amy Gutmann. Princeton: Princeton University Press. 1994: 149-163
  • Arendt, Hannah. The Human Condition. Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1958
  • Brandom, Robert. Reason in Philosophy: Animating Ideas. Cambridge, Ma.: Harvard University Press, 2009
  • Brandom, Robert. ‘The Structure of Desire and Recognition: Self-consciousness and Self-Constitution’. Philosophy & Social Criticism. 33:1 (2007): 127-150
  • Butler, Judith. ‘Performative Acts and Gender Constitution: An Essay in Phenomenology and Feminist Theory’. Theatre Journal, 40:4 (1988): 519-531
  • Butler, Judith.Gender Trouble: Feminism and the Subversion of Identity. New York: Routledge, 1990
  • Butler, Judith. ‘Contingent Foundations: Feminism and the Question of “Postmodernism”’. Feminists Theorize the Political. Ed. Butler, Judith and Joan W. Scott. London: Routledge, 1992. 3-21
  • De Beauvoir, Simone. The Second Sex. Harmondsworth: Penguin, 1972 [1949]
  • Fanon, Frantz. Black Skin, White Masks. London: Pluto, 1986 [1952]
  • Fichte, Johann G. Foundations in Natural Right: According to the Principles of the Wissenschaftslehre. Cambridge: CUP, 2000 [1796/7]
  • Foucault, Michel. Power/Knowledge: Selected Interviews and Other Writings. Brighton: Harvester, 1980
  • Foucault, Michel. Politics, Philosophy, Culture: Interviews and Other Writings 1977-1984. Ed. Kritzman, L. D. London: Routledge, 1988
  • Fraser, Nancy. Justice Interruptus: Critical Reflections on the “Postsocialist” Condition. New York: Routledge, 1997
  • Fraser, Nancy. ‘Rethinking Recognition’. New Left Review. 3 (2000): 107-120
  • Fraser, Nancy. ‘Recognition Without Ethics?’. Theory Culture & Society. 18:2-3 (2001): 21-42
  • Fraser, Nancy and Axel Honneth. Redistribution or Recognition: A Political-Philosophical Exchange. London: Verso, 2003
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Truth and Method. London: Sheed and Ward, 1975 [1960]
  • Haraway, Donna. Simians, Cyborgs, and Women: The Reinvention of Nature. London: Free Association Books, 1991
  • Hegel, Georg W. G. Phenomenology of the Spirit. Trans. A. V. Miller. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1977 [1807]
  • Hegel, Georg W. G. Elements of the Philosophy of Right. Trans. H. B. Nisbet. Cambridge: CUP, 1991 [1821]
  • Habermas, Jürgen. ‘A Reply’. Communicative Action. Ed. Honneth, Axel and Hans Joas. Cambridge: Polity, 1991
  • Heyes, Cressida. ‘Can There Be a Queer Politics of Recognition?’. Recognition, Responsibility, and Rights: Feminist Ethics and Social Theory. Ed. Fiore, Robin N. and Hilde L. Nelson. Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield, 2003: 53-66
  • Honneth, Axel. ‘Integrity and Disrespect: Principles of a Conception of Morality Based on the Theory of Recognition’. Political Theory, 20:2 (1992): 187-201
  • Honneth, Axel. The Struggle for Recognition: The Grammar of Social Conflicts. Cambridge: Polity, 1995
  • Honneth, Axel. ‘Recognition or Redistribution? Changing Perspectives on a Moral Order of Society’. Theory, Culture & Society. 18:2-3 (2001): 43-44
  • Honneth, Axel. Disrespect: The Normative Foundations of Critical Theory. Cambridge: Polity, 2007
  • Ikäheimo, Heikki. ‘On the Genus and Species of Recognition.’ Inquiry, 45 (2002): 447-62
  • Ikäheimo, Heikki and Arto Laitinen. ‘Analyzing Recognition: Identification, Acknowledgement, and Recognitive Attitudes Towards Persons.’ Recognition and Power: Axel Honneth and the Tradition of Social Theory. Ed. Bert van den Brink and David Owen. New York: CUP, 2007: 33-56
  • Inwood, Michael. A Hegel Dictionary. Oxford: Blackwell, 1992
  • Jones, Peter. ‘Equality, Recognition and Difference’. Critical Review of International Social and Political Philosophy. 9:1 (2006): 23-46
  • Jones, Peter (ed.). Group Rights. Aldershot: Ashgate, 2009
  • Kymlicka, Will. Multicultural Citizenship: A Liberal Theory of Minority Rights. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995
  • Laden, Anthony S. ‘Reasonable Deliberation, Constructive Power, and the Struggle for Recognition’. Recognition and Power: Axel Honneth and the Tradition of Social Theory. Ed. Bert van den Brink and David Owen. New York: CUP, 2007: 270-289
  • Laitinen, Arto. ‘Interpersonal Recognition: A Response to Value or a Precondition of Personhood?’ Inquiry, 45 (2002): 463-78
  • Levinas, Emmanuel. Totality and Infinity: An Essay on Exteriority. Pittsburgh: Duquesne University Press, 1969 [1961]
  • List, Christian and Philip Pettit, Group Agency. Oxford: OUP, 2011
  • Lloyd, Moya. Beyond Identity Politics: Feminism, Power & Politics. London: Sage, 2005
  • Margalit, Avishai. ‘Recognizing the Brother and the Other.’ Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society: Supplementary Volumes, vol. 75 (2001): 127-139
  • Markell, Patchen. ‘The Recognition of Politics: A Comment on Emcke and Tully’. Constellations, 7:4 (2002): 496-506
  • Markell, Patchen. Bound By Recognition. New Jersey: Princeton University Press, 2003
  • Markell, Patchen. ‘The Potential and the Actual: Mead, Honneth, and the “I”’. Recognition and Power: Axel Honneth and the Tradition of Social Theory. Ed. Bert van den Brink and David Owen. New York: CUP, 2007: 100-134
  • McBride, Cillian. ‘Demanding Recognition: Equality, Respect, and Esteem’. European Journal of Political Theory 8:1 (2009): 96-108
  • McNay, Lois. Against Recognition. Cambridge: Polity, 2008
  • Mead, George H. Mind, Self and Society: From the Standpoint of a Social Behaviourist. Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1934
  • Nicholson, Linda. ‘To Be or Not To Be: Charles Taylor and the Politics of Recognition’. Constellations, 3:1 (1996): 1-16
  • Merleau-Ponty, Maurice. Phenomenology of Perception. Trans. C. Smith. Oxford: Routledge, 2002 [1945]
  • Pinkard, Terry. Hegel’s Phenomenology: The Sociality of Reason. Cambridge: CUP, 1996
  • Rogers, Melvin L. ‘Rereading Honneth: Exodus Politics and the Paradox of Recognition’. European Journal of Political Theory, 8:2 (2007): 183-206
  • Rousseau, Jean-Jacques. ‘A Discourse on the Origin of Inequality’. Discourses and Other Early Political Writings. Trans. Victor Gourevitch. Cambridge: CUP, 1997 [1754]
  • Sartre, Jean-Paul. Being and Nothingness: An Essay in Phenomenological Ontology. London: Methuen & Co., 1957 [1943]
  • Stern, Robert. Hegel and the Phenomenology of Spirit. London: Routledge, 2002
  • Taylor, Charles. ‘The Politics of Recognition’. Multiculturalism: Examining the Politics of Recognition. Ed. Amy Gutmann. Princeton: Princeton University Press. 1994: 25-73
  • Thompson, Simon. The Political Theory of Recognition: A Critical Introduction. Cambridge: Polity, 2006
  • Tully, James. Strange Multiplicity: Constitutionalism in the Age of Diversity. Cambridge: CUP, 1995
  • Tuomela, Raimo. The Philosophy of Sociality: The Shared Point of View. Oxford: OUP. 2007
  • Williams, Robert R. Recognition: Fichte and Hegel on the Other. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1992
  • Williams, Robert R. Hegel’s Ethics of Recognition. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1992
  • Yar, Majid. ‘Recognition and the Politics of Human(e) Desires’. Recognition and Difference: Politics, Identity, Multiculture. Ed. Featherstone, Mike and Scott Lash. London: Sage, 2002
  • Young, Iris M. Justice and the Politics of Difference. New Jersey: Princeton University Press, 1990
  • Zurn, Christopher F. ‘Anthropology and Normativity: A Critique of Axel Honneth’s “Formal Conception of Ethical Life”’. Philosophy and Social Criticism, 26:1 (2000): 115-214
  • Zurn, Christopher F. ‘Identity or Status? Struggles Over ‘Recognition’ in Fraser, Honneth and Taylor’. Constellations, 10:4 (2003): 519-537

Author Information

Paddy McQueen
Queen's University
Northern Ireland

Relational Models Theory

Relational Models Theory is a theory in cognitive anthropology positing a biologically innate set of elementary mental models and a generative computational system operating upon those models.  The computational system produces compound models, using the elementary models as a kind of lexicon.  The resulting set of models is used in understanding, motivating, and evaluating social relationships and social structures.  The elementary models are intuitively quite simple and commonsensical.  They are as follows: Communal Sharing (having something in common), Authority Ranking (arrangement into a hierarchy), Equality Matching (striving to maintain egalitarian relationships), and Market Pricing (use of ratios).  Even though Relational Models Theory is classified as anthropology, it bears on several philosophical questions.

It contributes to value theory by describing a mental faculty which plays a crucial role in generating a plurality of values.  It thus shows how a single human nature can result in conflicting systems of value.  The theory also contributes to philosophy of cognition.  The complex models evidently result from a computational operation, thus supporting the view that a part of the mind functions computationally.  The theory contributes  to metaphysics.  Formal properties posited by the theory are perhaps best understood abstractly, raising the possibility that these mental models correspond to abstract objects.  If so, then Relational Models Theory reveals a Platonist ontology.

Table of Contents

  1. The Theory
    1. The Elementary Models
    2. Resemblance to Classic Measurement Scales
    3. Self-Organization and Natural Selection
    4. Compound Models
    5. Mods and Preos
  2. Philosophical Implications
    1. Moral Psychology
    2. Computational Conceptions of Cognition
    3. Platonism
  3. References
    1. Specifically Addressing Relational Models Theory
    2. Related Issues

1. The Theory

a. The Elementary Models

The anthropologist Alan Page Fiske pioneered Relational Models Theory (RMT).  RMT was originally conceived as a synthesis of certain constructs concerning norms formulated by Max Weber, Jean Piaget, and Paul Ricoeur.  Fiske then explored the theory among the Moose people of Burkina Faso in Africa.  He soon realized that its application was far more general, giving special insight into human nature.  According to RMT, humans are naturally social, using the relational models to structure and understand social interactions, the application of these models seen as intrinsically valuable. All relational models, no matter how complex, are, according to RMT, analyzable by four elementary models: Communal Sharing, Authority Ranking, Equality Matching, Market Pricing.

Any relationship informed by Communal Sharing presupposes a bounded group, the members of which are not differentiated from each other.  Distinguishing individual identities are socially irrelevant.  Generosity within a Communal Sharing group is not usually conceived of as altruism due to this shared identity, even though there is typically much behavior which otherwise would seem like extreme altruism.  Members of a Communal Sharing relationship typically feel that they share something in common, such as blood, deep attraction, national identity, a history of suffering, or the joy of food.  Examples include nationalism, racism, intense romantic love, indiscriminately killing any member of an enemy group in retaliation for the death of someone in one’s own group, sharing a meal.

An Authority Ranking relationship is a hierarchy in which individuals or groups are placed in relative higher or  lower relations .  Those ranked higher have prestige and privilege not enjoyed by those who are lower.  Further, the higher typically have some control over the actions of those who are lower.  However, the higher also have duties of protection and pastoral care for those beneath them.  Metaphors of spatial relation, temporal relation, and magnitude are typically used to distinguish people of different rank. For example, a King having a larger audience room than a Prince, or a King arriving after a Prince for a royal banquet.  Further examples include military rankings, the authority of parents over their children especially in more traditional societies, caste systems, and God’s authority over humankind.  Brute coercive manipulation is not considered to be Authority Ranking; it is more properly categorized as the Null Relation in which people treat each other in non-social ways.

In Equality Matching, one attempts to achieve and sustain an even balance and one-to-one correspondence between individuals or groups.  When there is not a perfect balance, people try to keep track of the degree of imbalance in order to calculate how much correction is needed.  “Equality matching is like using a pan balance: People know how to assemble actions on one side to equal any given weight on the other side” (Fiske 1992, 691).  If you and I are out of balance, we know what would restore equality.  Examples include the principle of one-person/one-vote, rotating credit associations, equal starting points in a race, taking turns offering dinner invitations, and giving an equal number of minutes to each candidate to deliver an on-air speech.

Market Pricing is the application of ratios to social interaction.  This can involve maximization or minimization as in trying to maximize profit or minimize loss.  But it can also involve arriving at an intuitively fair proportion, as in a judge deciding on a punishment proportional to a crime.  In Market Pricing, all socially relevant properties of a relationship are reduced to a single measure of value, such as money or pleasure.  Most utilitarian principles involve maximization.  An exception would be Negative Utilitarianism whose principle is the minimization of suffering.  But all utilitarian principles are applications of Market Pricing, since the maximum and the minimum are both proportions.  Other examples include rents, taxes, cost-benefit analyses including military estimates of kill ratios and proportions of fighter planes potentially lost, tithing, and prostitution.

RMT has been extensively corroborated by controlled studies based on research using a great variety of methods investigating diverse phenomena, including cross-cultural studies (Haslam 2004b).  The research shows that the elementary models play an important role in cognition including perception of other persons.

b. Resemblance to Classic Measurement Scales

It may be jarring to learn that intense romantic love and racism are both categorized as Communal Sharing or that tithing and prostitution are both instances of Market Pricing.  These examples illustrate that a relational model is, at its core, a meaningless formal structure.  Implementation in interpersonal relations and attendant emotional associations enter in on a different level of mental processing.  Each model can be individuated in purely formal terms, each elementary model strongly resembling one of the classic scale types familiar from measurement theory.  (Strictly speaking, it is each mod which can be individuated in purely formal terms.  This finer point will be discussed in the next section.)

Communal Sharing resembles a nominal (categorical) scale.  A nominal scale is simply classifying things into categories.  A questionnaire may be designed to categorize people as theist, atheist, agnostic, and other.  Such a questionnaire is measuring religious belief by using a nominal scale.  The groups into which Communal Sharing sorts people is similar.  One either belongs to a pertinent group or one does not, there being no degree or any shades of gray.  Another illustration of nominal scaling is the pass/fail system of grading.  Authority Ranking resembles an ordinal scale in which items are ranked.  The ranking of students according to their performance is one example.  The ordered classification of shirts in a store as small, medium, large, and extra large is another.  Equality Matching resembles an interval scale.  On interval scales , any unit measures the same magnitude on any point in the scale.  For example, on the Celsius scale the difference between 1 degree and 2 degrees is the same as the difference between 5 degrees and 6 degrees.  Equality Matching resembles an interval scale insofar as one can measure the degree of inequality in a social relationship using equal intervals so as to judge how to correct the imbalance.  It is by use of such a scale that people in an Equality Matching interaction can specify how much one person owes another.  However, an interval scale cannot be used to express a ratio because it has no absolute zero point.  For example, the zero point on the Celsius scale is not absolute so one cannot say that 20 degrees is twice as warm as 10 degrees while on a Kelvin scale because the zero point is absolute one can express ratios.  Given that Market Pricing is the application of ratios to social interactions, it resembles a ratio scale such as the Kelvin scale.  One cannot, for example, meaningfully speak of the maximization of utility without presupposing some sort of ratio scale for measuring utility.  Maximization would correspond to 100 percent.

c. Self-Organization and Natural Selection

The four measurement scales correspond to different levels of semantic richness and precision.  The nominal scale conveys little information, being very coarse grained.  For example, pass/fail grading conveys less information than ranking students.  Giving letter grades is even more precise and semantically rich, conveying how much one student out-performs another.  This is the use of an interval scale.  The most informative and semantically rich is a percentage grade which illustrates the ratio by which one student out-performs another, hence a ratio scale.  For example, if graded accurately a student scoring 90 percent has done twice as well as a student scoring 45 percent.  Counterexamples may be apparent: two students could be ranked differently while receiving the same letter grade by using a deliberately coarse-grained letter grading system so as to minimize low grades.  To take an extreme case, a very generous instructor might award an A to every student (after all, no student was completely lost in class) while at the same time mentally ranking the students in terms of their performance.  Split grades are sometimes used to smooth out the traditional coarse-grained letter grading system .  But, if both scales are as sensitive as possible and based on the same data, the interval scale will convey more information than the ordinal scale.  The ordinal ranking will be derivable from the interval grading, but not vice versa.  This is more obvious in the case of temperature measurement, in which grade inflation is not an issue.  Simply ranking objects in terms of warmer/colder conveys less information than does Celsius measurement.

One scale is more informative than another because it is less symmetrical; greater asymmetry means that more information is conveyed.  On a measurement scale, a permutation which distorts or changes information is an asymmetry.  Analogously, a permutation in a social-relational arrangement which distorts or changes social relations is an asymmetry.  In either case, a permutation which does not carry with it such a distortion or change is symmetric.  The nominal scale type is the most symmetrical scale type, just as Communal Sharing is the most symmetrical elementary model.  In either case, the only asymmetrical permutation is one which moves an item out of a category, for example, expelling someone from the social group.  Any permutation within the category or group makes no difference; no difference to the information conveyed, no difference to the social relation.  In the case of pass/fail grading, the student’s performance could be markedly different from what it actually was.  So long as the student does well enough to pass (or poorly enough to fail), this would not have changed the grade.  Thanks to this high degree of symmetry, the nominal scale conveys relatively little information.

The ordinal scale is less symmetrical.  Any permutation that changes rankings is asymmetrical, since it distorts or changes something significant.  But items arranged could change in many respects relative to each other while their ordering remains unaffected, so a high level of symmetry remains.  Students could vary in their performance, but so long as their relative ranking remains the same, this would make no difference to grades based on an ordinal scale.

An interval scale is even less symmetrical and hence more informative, as seen in the fact that a system of letter grades conveys more information than does a mere ranking of students.  An interval scale conveys the relative degrees of difference between items.  If one student improves from doing C level work to B level work, this would register on an interval scale but would remain invisible on an ordinal scale if the change did not affect student ranking.  Analogously, in Equality Matching, if one person, and one person only, were to receive an extra five minutes to deliver their campaign speech, this would be socially significant.  By contrast, in Authority Ranking, the addition of an extra five minutes to the time taken by a Prince to deliver a speech would make no socially significant difference provided that the relative ranking remains undisturbed (for example, the King still being allotted more time than the Prince, and the Duke less than the Prince).

In Market Pricing, as in any ratio scale, the asymmetry is even greater.  Adding five years to the punishment of every convict could badly skew what should be proportionate punishments.  But giving an extra five minutes to each candidate would preserve balance in Equality Matching.

The symmetries of all the scale types have an interesting formal property.  They form a descending symmetry subgroup chain.  In other words, the symmetries of a ratio scale form a subset of the symmetries of a relevant interval scale, the symmetries of that scale form a subset of the symmetries of a relevant ordinal scale, and the symmetries of that scale form a subset of the symmetries of a relevant nominal scale.  More specifically, the scale types form a containment hierarchy.  Analogously, the symmetries of Market Pricing form a subset of the symmetries of Equality Matching which form a subset of the symmetries of Authority Ranking which form a subset of the symmetries of Communal Sharing.  Descending subgroup chains are common in nature, including inorganic nature.  The symmetries of solid matter form a subset of the symmetries of liquid matter which form a subset of the symmetries of gaseous matter which form a subset of the symmetries of plasma.

This raises interesting questions about the origins of these patterns in the mind: could they result from spontaneous symmetry breakings in brain activity rather than being genetically encoded?  Darwinian adaptations are genetically encoded, whereas spontaneous symmetry breaking is ubiquitous in nature rather than being limited to genetically constrained structures.  The appeal to spontaneous symmetry breaking suggests a non-Darwinian approach to understanding how the elementary models could be “innate” (in the sense of being neither learned nor arrived at through reason).  That is, are the elementary relational models results of self-organization rather than learning or natural selection?  If they are programmed into the genome, why would this programming imitate a pattern in nature which usually occurs without genetic encoding?  The spiral shape of a galaxy, for example, is due to spontaneous symmetry breaking, as is the transition from liquid to solid.  But these transitions are not encoded in genes, of course.  Being part of the natural world, why should the elementary models be understood any differently?

d. Compound Models

While all relational models are analyzable into four fundamental models, the number of models as such is potentially infinite.  This is because social-relational cognition is productive; any instance of a model can serve as a constituent in an even more complex instance of a model.  Consider Authority Ranking and Market Pricing; an instance of one can be embedded in or subordinated to an instance of the other.  When a judge decides on a punishment that is proportionate to the crime, the judge is using a ratio scale and hence Market Pricing.  But the judge is only authorized to do this because of her authority, hence Authority Ranking.  We have here a case of Market Pricing embedded in a superordinate (as opposed to subordinate) structure of Authority Ranking resulting in a compound model.  Now consider ordering food from a waiter.  The superordinate relationship is now Market Pricing, since one is paying for the waiter’s service.  But the service itself is Authority Ranking with the customer as the superior party.  In this case, an instance of Authority Ranking is subordinate to an instance of Market Pricing.  This is also a compound model with the same constituents but differently arranged.  The democratic election of a leader is Authority Ranking subordinated to Equality Matching.  An elementary school teacher’s supervising children to make sure they take turns is Equality Matching subordinated to Authority Ranking.

A model can also be embedded in a model of the same type.  In some complex egalitarian social arrangements, one instance of Equality Matching can be embedded in another.  Anton Pannekoek’s proposed Council Communism is one such example.  The buying and selling of options is the buying and selling of the right to buy and sell, hence recursively embedded Market Pricing.  Moose society is largely structured by a complex model involving multiple levels of Communal Sharing.  A family among the Moose is largely structured by Communal Sharing, as is the village which embeds it, as is the larger community that embeds the village, and so on.  In principle, there is no upper limit on the number of embeddings in a compound model.  Hence, the number of potential relational models is infinite.

e. Mods and Preos

A model, whether elementary or compound, is devoid of meaning when considered in isolation.  As purely abstract structures, models are sometimes known as “mods” , which is an abbreviation of, “cognitively modular but modifiable modes of interacting” (Fiske 2004, 3).  (This may be a misnomer, since, as purely formal structures devoid of semantic content, mods are not modes of social interaction any more than syntax.   is a communication system.)  In order to externalize models, that is, in order to use them to interpret or motivate or structure interactions, one needs “preos,” these being “socially transmitted prototypes, precedents, and principles that complete the mods, specifying how, when and with respect to whom the mods apply” (2004, 4).  Strictly speaking, a relational model is the union of a mod with a preo.  A mod has the formal properties of symmetry, asymmetry, and in some cases embeddedness.  But a mod requires a preo in order to have the properties intuitively identifiable as meaningful, such as social application, emotional resonance, and motivating force.

The notion of a preo updates and includes the notion of an implementation rule, from an earlier stage of relational-models theorizing.  Fiske has identified five kinds of implementation rules (1991, 142).  One kind specifies the domain to which a model applies.  For example, in some cultures Authority Ranking is used to structure and give meaning to marriage.  In other cultures, Authority Ranking does not structure marriage and may even be viewed as immoral in that context.  Another sort of implementation rule specifies the individuals or groups which are to be related by the model.  Communal Sharing, for example, can be applied to different groups of people.  Experience, and sometimes also agreement, decides who is in the Communal Sharing group.  In implementing Authority Ranking, it is not enough to specify how many ranks there are.  One must also specify who belongs to which rank.  A third sort of implementation rule defines values and categories.  In Equality Matching, each participant must give or receive the same thing.  But what counts as the same thing?  In Authority Ranking, a higher-up deserves honor from a lower-down, but what counts as honor and what constitutes showing honor?  There are no a priori or innate answers to these questions; culture and mutual agreement help settle such matters.  Consider the principle of one-person/one-vote, an example of Equality Matching.  Currently in the United States and Great Britain, whoever gets the most votes wins the election.  But it is also possible to have a system in which a two-thirds majority is necessary for there to be a winner.  Without a two-thirds majority, there may be a coalition government, a second election with the lowest performing candidates eliminated, or some other arrangement.  These are different ways of determining what counts as treating each citizen as having an equal say.  A fourth determines the code used to indicate the existence and quality of the relationship.  Authority Ranking is coded differently in different cultures, as it can be represented by the size of one’s office, the height of one’s throne, the number of bars on one’s sleeve, and so forth.  A fifth sort of implementation rule concerns a general tendency to favor some elementary models over others.  For example, Market Pricing may be highly valued in some cultures as fair and reasonable while categorized as dehumanizing in others.  The same is clearly true of Authority Ranking.  Communal Sharing is much more prominent and generally valued in some cultures than in others.  This does not mean that any culture is completely devoid of any specific elementary model but that some models are de-emphasized and marginalized in some cultures as compared to others.  So the union of mod and preo may even serve to marginalize the resulting model in relation to other models.

The fact that the same mod can be united with different preos is one source of normative plurality across cultures, to be discussed in the next section.  Another source is the generation of distinct compound mods.  Different cultures can use different mods, since there is a considerable number of potential mods to choose from.

2. Philosophical Implications

a. Moral Psychology

Each elementary model crucially enters into certain moral values.  An ethic of service to one’s group is a form of Communal Sharing.  It is an altruistic ethic in some sense, but bear in mind that all members of the group share a common identity.  So, strictly speaking, it is not true altruism.  Authority Ranking informs an ethic of obedience to authority including respect, honor, and loyalty.  Any questions of value remaining to be clarified are settled by the authority; subordinates are expected to follow the values thus dictated.  Fairness and even distribution are informed by Equality Matching.  John Rawls’ veil of ignorance exemplifies Equality Matching; a perspective in which one does not know which role one will play guarantees that one aim for equality.  Gregory Vlastos has even attempted to reduce all distributive justice to a framework that can be identified with Equality Matching.  Market Pricing informs libertarian values of freely entering into contracts and taking risks with the aim of increasing one’s own utility or the utility of one’s group.  But this also includes suffering the losses when one’s calculations prove incorrect.  Utilitarianism is a somewhat counterintuitive attempt to extend this sort of morality to all sentient life, but is still recognizable as Market Pricing.  It would be too simple, however, to say that there are only four sorts of values in RMT.  In fact, combinations of models yield complex models, resulting in a potential infinity of complex values.  Potential variety is further increased by the variability of possible preos.  This great variety of values leads to value conflicts most noticeably across cultures.

RMT strongly suggests value pluralism, in Isaiah Berlin’s sense of “pluralism”.  The pluralism in question is a cultural pluralism, different traditions producing mutually incommensurable values.  Berlin drew a distinction between relativism and pluralism, even though there are strong similarities between the two.  Relativism and pluralism both acknowledge values which are incommensurable, meaning that they cannot be reconciled and that there is no absolute or objective way to judge between them.  Pluralism, however, acknowledges empathy and emotional understanding across cultures.  Even if one does not accept the values of another culture, one still has an emotional understanding of how such values could be adopted.  This stands in contrast to relativism, as defined by Berlin.  If relativism is true, then there can be no emotional understanding of alien values.  One understands the value system of an alien culture in essentially the same manner as one understands the behavior of ants or, for that matter, the behavior of tectonic plates; it is a purely causal understanding.  It is the emotionally remote understanding of the scientist rather than the empathic understanding of someone engaging, say, with the poetry and theatre of another culture.  Adopting RMT, pluralism seems quite plausible.  Given that one has the mental capacity to generate the relevant model, one can replicate the alien value in oneself.  One is not simply thinking about the foreigner’s relational model, but using one’s shared human nature to produce that same model in oneself.  This does not, however, mean that one adopts that value, since one can also retain the conflicting model characteristic of one’s own culture.  One’s decisive motivation may still flow wholly from the latter.

But the significance of RMT for the debate over pluralism and absolutism may be more complex than indicated above.  Since RMT incorporates the view that people perceive social relationships as intrinsic values, this may indicate that a society which fosters interactions and relationships is absolutely better than one which divides and atomizes, at least along that one dimension.  This may be an element of moral absolutism in RMT, and it is interesting to see how it is to be reconciled with any pluralism also implied.

b. Computational Conceptions of Cognition

The examples of embedding in Section 1.d. not only illustrate the productivity of social-relational cognition, but also its systematicity.  To speak of the systematicity of thought means that the ability to think a given thought renders probable the ability to think a semantically close thought.  The ability to conceive of Authority Ranking embedding Market Pricing makes it highly likely that one can conceive of Market Pricing embedding Authority Ranking.  One finds productivity and systematicity in language as well.  Any phrase can be embedded in a superordinate phrase.  For example, the determiner phrase [the water] is embedded in the prepositional phrase [in [the water]], and the prepositional phrase [in [the water]] is embedded in the determiner phrase [the fish [in [the water]]].  The in-principle absence of limit here means that the number of phrases is infinite.  Further, the ability to parse (or understand) a phrase renders very probable the ability to parse (or understand) a semantically close phrase.  For example, being able to mentally process Plato did trust Socrates makes it likely that one can process Socrates did trust Plato as well as Plato did trust Plato and Socrates did trust Socrates.  Productivity and systematicity, either in language or in social-relational cognition, constitute a strong inductive argument for a combinatorial operation that respects semantic relations.  (The operation respects semantic relations, given that the meaning of a generated compound is a function of the meanings of its constituents and their arrangement.)  In other words, it is an argument for digital computation.

This is essentially Noam Chomsky’s argument for a computational procedure explaining syntax (insofar as syntax is not idiomatic).  It is also essentially Jerry Fodor’s argument for computational procedures constituting thought processes more generally.  That digital computation underlies both complex social-relational cognition and language raises important questions.  Are all mental processes largely computational or might language and social-relational cognition be special cases?  Do language and social-relational cognition share the same computational mechanism or do they each have their own?  What are the constraints on computation in either language or social-relational cognition?

c. Platonism

Chomsky has noted the discrete infinity of language.  Each phrase consists of a number of constituents which can be counted using natural numbers (discreteness), and there is no longest phrase meaning that the set of all possible phrases is infinite.  Analogous points apply to social-relational cognition.  The number of instances of an elementary mod within any mod can be counted using natural numbers.  In the case discussed earlier in which a customer is ordering food from a waiter, there is one instance of Authority Ranking embedded in one instance of Market Pricing.  The total number of instances is two, a natural number.  There is no principled upper limit on the number of embeddings, hence infinity.  The discrete infinity of language and social-relational cognition is tantamount to their productivity.

However, some philosophers, especially Jerrold Katz, have argued that nothing empirical can exhibit discrete infinity.  Something empirical may be continuously infinite, such as a volume of space containing infinitely many points.  But the indefinite addition of constituent upon constituent has no empirical exemplification.  Space-time, if it were finite in this sense, would contain only finite energy and a finite number of particles.  There are not infinitely many objects, as discrete infinity would imply.  On this reasoning, the discrete infinity of an entity can only mean that the entity exists beyond space and time, still assuming that space-time is finite.  This would mean that sentences, and by similar reasoning compound mods as well, are abstract objects rather than neural features or processes.  This would mean that mods and sentences are abstract objects like numbers.  One finds here a kind of Platonism, Platonism here defined as the view that there are abstract objects.

As a tentative reply, one could say that the symbols generated by a computational system are potentially infinite in number, but this raises questions about the nature of potentiality.  What is a merely potential mod or a merely potential sentence?  It is not something with any spatiotemporal location or any causal power.  Perhaps it is sentence types (as contrasted with tokens) that exhibit discrete infinity.  And likewise with mods, it is mod types that exhibit discrete infinity.  But here too, one is appealing to entities, namely types, that have no spatiotemporal location or causal power.  By definition, these are abstract objects.

The case for Platonism is perhaps stronger for compound mods, but one could also defend the same conclusion with regard to the elementary mods.  Each elementary mod, as noted earlier, corresponds to one of the classic measurement scales.  Different scale types are presupposed by different logics.  Classical two-valued logic presupposes a nominal scale, as illustrated by the law of excluded middle: a statement is either on the truth scale, in which case it is true, or off the scale, in which case it is false.  Alternatively, one could posit two categories, one for true and one for false, and stipulate that any statement belongs on one scale or the other.  Fuzzy logics conceive truth either in terms of interval scales, for example, it is two degrees more true that Michel is bald than that Van is bald, or in terms of ratio scales, for example, it is 80 percent true that Van is bald, 100 percent true that Michel is bald.  Even though it has perhaps not been formalized, there is intuitively a logic which presupposes an ordinal scale.  A logic, say,  in which it is more true that chess is a game than that Ring a Ring o’ Roses is a game, even though it would be meaningless to ask how much more.  If nominal, ordinal, interval, and ratio scales are more basic than various logics, then the question arises as to whether they can seriously be considered empirical or spatiotemporal.  If anything is Platonic, then something more basic than logic is likely to be Platonic.  And what is an elementary mod aside from the scale type which it “resembles”?  Is there any reason to distinguish the elementary mod from the scale type itself?  If not, then the elementary mods themselves are abstract objects, at least on this argument.

Does reflection upon language and the relational models support a Platonist metaphysic?  If so, what is one to make of the earlier discussion of RMT appealing, as it did, to neural symmetry breakings and mental computations?  If mods are abstract objects, then the symmetry breakings and computations may belong to the epistemology of RMT rather than to its metaphysics.  In other words, they may throw light on how one knows about mods rather than actually constituting the mods themselves.  Specifically, the symmetry breaking and computations may account for the production of mental representations of mods rather than the mods themselves.  But whether or not there is a good case here for Platonism is, no doubt, open to further questioning.

3. References

a. Specifically Addressing Relational Models Theory

  • Bolender, John. (2010), The Self-Organizing Social Mind (Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press).
    • Argues that the elementary relational models are due to self-organizing brain activity.  Also contains a discussion of possible Platonist implications of RMT.
  • Bolender, John. (2011), Digital Social Mind (Exeter, UK: Imprint Academic).
    • Argues that complex relational models are due to mental computations.
  • Fiske, Alan Page. (1990), “Relativity within Moose (‘Mossi’) culture: four incommensurable models for social relationships,” Ethos, 18, pp. 180-204.
    • Fiske here argues that RMT supports moral relativism, although his “relativism” may be the same as Berlin’s “pluralism.”
  • Fiske, Alan Page. (1991), Structures of Social Life: The Four Elementary Forms of Human Relations (New York: The Free Press).
    • The classic work on RMT, containing the first full statement of the theory and a wealth of anthropological illustrations.
  • Fiske, Alan Page. (1992), “The Four Elementary Forms of Sociality: Framework for a Unified Theory of Social Relations,” Psychological Review, 99, 689-723.
    • Essentially, a shorter version of Fiske’s (1991).  Nonetheless, this is a detailed and substantial introduction to RMT.
  • Fiske, Alan Page. (2004), “Relational Models Theory 2.0,” in Haslam (2004a).
    • An updated introduction to RMT.
  • Haslam, Nick. ed. (2004a), Relational Models Theory: A Contemporary Overview (Mahwah, New Jersey and London: Lawrence Erlbaum).
    • An anthology containing an updated introduction to RMT as well as discussions of controlled empirical evidence supporting the theory.
  • Haslam, Nick. ed. (2004b), “Research on the Relational Models: An Overview,” in Haslam (2004a).
    • Reviews controlled studies corroborating that the elementary relational models play an important role in cognition including person perception.
  • Pinker, Steven. (2007), The Stuff of Thought: Language as a Window into Human Nature (London: Allen Lane).
    • Argues that Market Pricing, in contrast to the other three elementary models, is not innate and is somehow unnatural.

b. Related Issues

  • Berlin, Isaiah. (1990), The Crooked Timber of Humanity: Chapters in the History of Ideas. Edited by H. Hardy (London: Pimlico).
    • A discussion of value pluralism in the context of history of ideas.
  • Fodor, Jerry A. (1987), Psychosemantics: The Problem of Meaning in the Philosophy of Mind (Cambridge, Mass. and London: MIT Press).
    • The Appendix argues that systematicity and productivity in thought require a combinatorial system.  The point, however, is a general one, not specifically focused on social-relational cognition.
  • Katz, Jerrold J. (1996), “The unfinished Chomskyan revolution,” Mind & Language, 11 (3), pp. 270-294.
    • Argues that only an abstract object can exhibit discrete infinity.
  • Rawls, John. (1971), A Theory of Justice (Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press).
    • The veil of ignorance illustrates Equality Matching.
  • Szpiro, George G. (2010), Numbers Rule: The Vexing Mathematics of Democracy, from Plato to the Present (Princeton: Princeton University Press).
    • Illustrates various ways in which Equality Matching can be implemented.
  • Stevens, S. S. (1946), “On the Theory of Scales of Measurement,” Science 103, pp. 677-680.
    • A classic discussion of the types of measurement scales.
  • Vlastos, Gregory. (1962), “Justice and Equality,” in Richard B. Brandt, ed. Social Justice (Englewood Cliffs, New Jersey: Prentice-Hall).
    • An attempt to understand all distributive justice in terms of Equality Matching.

Author Information

John Bolender
Middle East Technical University

Global Ethics: Capabilities Approach

The capabilities approach is meant to identify a space in which we can make cross-cultural judgments about ways of life. The capabilities approach is radically different from, yet indebted to, traditional ethical theories such as virtue ethics, consequentialism and deontology.

This article begins with a background on global ethics. This situates the capabilities approach as a possible solution to the problems that arise from globalization. The second section provides Amartya Sen's account of the basic framework of the capabilities approach. That section also shows how Martha Nussbaum develops the approach. The third section describes Nussbaum's list of ten central capabilities. This list has been viewed by some philosophers as a definitive list, while others, notably Sen, have argued that no list is complete, because a list should always be subject to revision. The fourth section shows how the approach is similar to, yet very different from, traditional ethical theories such as virtue ethics, consequentialism and deontology. The capabilities approach is shown to add to the approaches of global ethics such as communitarianism, human rights, and the approach of John Rawls. The section compares Michael Boylan's table of embeddedness with Nussbaum's capabilities list. The fifth section discusses two main philosophical critiques of the capabilities approach. First, and most notably, Alison Jaggar criticizes Nussbaum for not paying closer attention to asymmetrical power relations. Second, Bernard Williams raises questions about what constitutes a capability. The sixth section shows how the capabilities approach has been applied to advance various areas of applied philosophy including the environment and disability ethics. The final section explains how the capabilities approach has been undertaken as a global endeavor by the United Nations Development Program to fight poverty and illiteracy and to empower women.

Table of Contents

  1. Background of Global Ethics
  2. The Capabilities Approach
    1. Sen
    2. Nussbaum
  3. Nussbaum's List of Central Capabilities
  4. The Relationship between the Capabilities Approach and Other Ethical Theories
    1. Virtue Ethics
    2. Communitarianism
    3. Deontology
    4. Rawls' The Law of Peoples
    5. Human Rights
    6. Consequentialism
    7. Boylan’s Table of Embeddedness
  5. Philosophical Criticisms of the Capabilities Approach
    1. Illiberal and Neo-Colonialist
    2. What Is a Capability?
  6. Philosophical Applications
    1. The Environment
    2. Disability Ethics
  7. United Nations Development Program
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Background of Global Ethics

Issues of globalization have sparked great controversy since the 1980s. Globalization, broadly construed, is manifested in various forms of social activity including economic, political and cultural life. Practicing global ethics entails moral reasoning across borders. Borders can entail culture, religion, ethnicity, gender, race, class, sexuality, global location, historical experience, environment, species and nations. Ethicists ask how we best address issues of globalization–that is, how we begin to address conflicts that arise when vastly different cultural norms, values, and practices collide.


There have been two broad philosophical approaches to address cross-border moral disagreement and conflict. The dominant approach aims to develop moral theories that are not committed to a single metaphysical world-view or religious foundation, but are compatible with various perspectives. In other words, it is a goal to develop a theory that is both ‘thick’ (that is, it has a robust conception of the good embedded within a particular context, and respects local traditions) and ‘thin’ (that is, it embraces a set of universal norms). These universalists include human rights theorists, Onora O’Neill’s deontology, Seyla Benhabib’s discourse ethics and Martha Nussbaum’s capabilities approach. They tend to be associated with constructing ‘thin’ theories of morality. The other approach, most notably advocated by Michael Walzer, is communitarianism. Communitarians deny the possibility of developing a single universal standard of flourishing that is both thick enough to be useful and thin enough to support reasonable pluralism.


The debate between these two approaches to global ethics has reached an impasse. Since communitarians hold that moral norms are always local and valid internal to a particular community, universalists charge the communitarians with relativism. Moreover, universalists argue that communitarians fail to provide useful methods for addressing cross-border moral conflict. However, the communitarians charge the universalists with either positing theories that are too thin to be useful or advancing theories that are substantive but covertly build in premises that are not universally shared, and so risk cultural imperialism.


Martha Nussbaum believes her capabilities theory resolves the impasse and offers a viable approach to global ethics that provides a universal measure of human flourishing while also respecting religious and cultural differences. The capabilities approach, she argues, is universal, but 'of a particular type.' That is, it is a thick (or substantive) theory of morality that accommodates pluralism. Thus, she argues that her theory avoids criticisms applied to other universalists and communitarians. Before examining her theory, we must address her predecessor, Amartya Sen.

2. The Capabilities Approach

a. Sen

Amartya Sen, an economic theorist and founder of the capabilities approach, developed his theory in order to identify a space in which we can make cross cultural judgments on the quality of life. To best understand how these judgments can be passed, we must investigate a critical distinction made by proponents of the capabilities approach–between function and capability. A function, on the one hand, according to Sen, is an achievement, but this should be broadly understood to include any 'state of being.' Let's examine Sen's bike-riding example to shed light on a 'function.' He says a bicyclist has achieved the purpose of what one does with a bike–namely, ride it. From this example, clearly the choice to ride a bike is a function of a human being, however, the scope of functioning is not merely limited to a person's intention to ride the bike. A 'function' entails any 'state of being' which includes excitement, happiness and fear. For example, a child who first begins to ride her bike may display a great amount of fear as she wobbles down the road, but once she understands how to ride the bike smoothly, she can enjoy (or perhaps become excited) riding her bike. Thus, when the child rides her bike (and is excited from doing so), she has performed the functions of riding a bike, and having the emotions associated with doing so, while partaking in the capability of play.

A capability, on the other hand, is a possibility, not just any possibility, but a real one. For example, we can talk about the possibility of a person in a deeply poverty-stricken area to find employment and support a family. However, such a possibility may not be real considering external circumstances–for example, no clothing, food or shelter. Put differently, a 'capability set' (as Sen calls it) is the total functions available for a person to perform.  By describing it in such a way, Sen places a deep correlation between freedom and function. That is to say, the more limited one's freedom, the less opportunities one has to fulfill one's functions. In sum, Crocker (2008) says succinctly that, according to Sen, a capability X entails (1) having the real possibility for X which (2) depends on my powers and (3) and no external circumstances preventing me from X.

A capability and function should not be understood as mutually exclusive or completely paralleling one another. Let's consider two people with the same capabilities. Even though they have same capabilities, they may participate in radically different functions. For example, two people may both have the opportunity to engage in play, but do so in radically different ways (for example, one may swim while the other volunteers at a homeless shelter). Proponents of the capabilities approach argue this makes the theory most attractive, that is, it accommodates various ways of life even though it puts forth a conception of the good. Now, let's consider a situation in which people participate in the same functions, but possess different capabilities set. Consider Sen's example of hunger. Two people may be hungry, but for radically different reasons. Consider, on the one hand, a person who seeks to fulfill her desire to eat, but cannot because of socio-economic circumstances.  On the other, a person may be hungry because she is fasting for religious reasons or protesting an injustice. In both examples, the person suffers from starvation, but for radically different reasons.

b. Nussbaum

Nussbaum begins her capabilities approach by noting her indebtedness to Aristotle and Karl Marx (and to a lesser extent, J.S. Mill). Like Sen, she embraces the capabilities/function distinction. However, she begins to part ways with Sen’s philosophy when she grounds her theory in Marx and Aristotle. In doing so she argues that a function must not be performed in just any way, but in a 'truly human way.' That is to say, if a person lives a life where she is unable to exercise her human powers (for example, self-expressive creativity) then she is living her life in more of an animalistic manner than as a human being.

Nussbaum seeks a capabilities approach that can fully express human powers and not just provide (real) opportunities for people to perform certain functions. In other words, she does not deny, as Sen argues, that a capability is a real possibility or opportunity for an individual to perform certain actions, but that is merely necessary and not sufficient for the capabilities approach. Sen is missing, according to Nussbaum, aspects of what is particularly unique to human beings, that is, human powers. Nussbaum understands the capabilities/function distinction as multiply realized–that is, while the capabilities are the space for the opportunity for particular actions, the way in which that space is manifested, via different actions, is a person's functioning.

Nussbaum notes that there are three specific differences that sets her capabilities approach apart from Sen. First, Nussbaum (2000) charges Sen with not explicitly rejecting cultural relativism. She agrees with his sympathies for universal norms, she also, criticizes his inability to completely reject cultural relativism. Second, Nussbaum criticizes Sen for not grounding his theory in a Marxian/Aristotelian idea of true human functioning. This is not to say that he would reject Nussbaum's conclusions drawn from Marx and Aristotle, but rather he is not specifically indebted to (and does not ground his theory in) them.  Third, Sen does not provide an explicit list of central capabilities As a matter of fact, Sen has been critical of attempting to provide a list of central capabilities. Nonetheless, these three points of division seem to separate Sen and Nussbaum.

Nussbaum's two philosophical justifications are the non-Platonic substantive good approach (that is, intuitionism) and a limited role of proceduralism (that is, discourse ethics)–which are a point of contention amongst critics. According to the former, the primary justification for the capabilities approach, we test various ethical theories against our fixed intuitions and decide which theory best matches them. Nussbaum contends that the theory that best represents our intuitions is the capabilities approach. The intuition that grounds the capabilities, according to Nussbaum, is the intuition of a dignified human life whereby people have the capability to pursue their conception of the good in cooperation with others. Consider her example of a person's fixed intuition that rape is damaging to human dignity. She claims if one matches that intuition against all ethical theories that it will be best represented by the capabilities approach.

One may have reservations for this justification in situations where a person has underdeveloped (that is, intuitions that have not been challenged by competing intuitions) or mistaken intuitions. In response, Nussbaum argues that underdeveloped and mistaken intuitions must be rejected, and replaced with diversely experienced people who have tested their intuitions against competing beliefs. Although Nussbaum notes the primacy of intuitionism, she also argues that proceduralism has an ancillary justification for the capabilities approach.

Nussbaum's proceduralism begins not with an intuition, but with a decision procedure, and it is the procedure that confers justification on the outcome. She is sympathetic to this form of proceduralism since it is rooted in Kantian discourse ethics (adopted by Jean Hampton), and has accordingly built into it a conception of equal human worth. In that sense proceduralism is similar to the intuitionist justification. However, there are stark contrasts. What is proceduralism, then? The version Nussbaum is concerned with claims that one consults the desires or preferences of another who is impacted by the outcome of the decision at hand. Similar to the concern above, Nussbaum fears that many people's desires (like intuitions) will be corrupt, and thus produce a morally repugnant conclusion. Therefore, she seeks not just any desires, but 'informed desires,' that is, desires constructed by treating people with dignity. However, because not all desires are informed, and yet proceduralism calls for us to consult all desires affected by the decision, the capabilities approach would be placed on too weak of a foundation. Thus, in virtue of all the mistaken desires, proceduralism merely plays an ancillary role. Yet, it's fair to say that if everyone had informed desires, then Nussbaum would grant proceduralism as a primary justification for the capabilities approach.

These two justifications are meant to be mutually reinforcing. They are meant to justify both the capabilities approach qua theory and the particular list of central capabilities put forth by Nussbaum. However, due to the limitations Nussbaum places on proceduralism, we must rely on intuitionism as the main justification.

3. Nussbaum's List of Central Capabilities


There is much debate over whether Nussbaum's list of central capabilities is revisable, and thus subject to change, or whether it is a fixed set of capabilities that cannot be compromised. Earlier in her career, Nussbaum (1995) argued that her list was static, however, she has since backed off such a claim and acknowledged the possibility that they could be altered. From her book, Women and Human Development: The Capabilities Approach (WHD hereafter), here is her list of capabilities, along with a brief description of each.

1. Life – Able to live to the end of a normal length human life, and to not have one's life reduced to not worth living.

2. Bodily Health – Able to have a good life which includes (but is not limited to) reproductive health, nourishment and shelter.

3. Bodily Integrity – Able to change locations freely, in addition to, having sovereignty over one's body which includes being secure against assault (for example, sexual assault, child sexual abuse, domestic violence and the opportunity for sexual satisfaction).

4. Senses, Imagination and Thought – Able to use one's senses to imagine, think and reason in a 'truly human way'–informed by an adequate education. Furthermore, the ability to produce self-expressive works and engage in religious rituals without fear of political ramifications. The ability to have pleasurable experiences and avoid unnecessary pain. Finally, the ability to seek the meaning of life.

5. Emotions – Able to have attachments to things outside of ourselves; this includes being able to love others, grieve at the loss of loved ones and be angry when it is justified.

6. Practical Reason – Able to form a conception of the good and critically reflect on it.

7. Affiliation

A. Able to live with and show concern for others, empathize with (and show compassion for) others and the capability of justice and friendship. Institutions help develop and protect forms of affiliation.

B. Able to have self-respect and not be humiliated by others, that is, being treated with dignity and equal worth. This entails (at the very least) protections of being discriminated on the basis of race, sex, sexuality, religion, caste, ethnicity and nationality. In work, this means entering relationships of mutual recognition.

8. Other Species – Able to have concern for and live with other animals, plants and the environment at large.

9. Play – Able to laugh, play and enjoy recreational activities.

10. Control over One's Environment

A. Political – Able to effectively participate in the political life which includes having the right to free speech and association.

B. Material – Able to own property, not just formally, but materially (that is, as a real opportunity). Furthermore, having the ability to seek employment on an equal basis as others, and the freedom from unwarranted search and seizure.

Even though Nussbaum claims each of the ten capabilities is equally important, she places special emphasis on two of them–namely, practical reason and affiliation. We see the importance when she explicitly says the core behind the intuition of human functioning is that of a dignified free person who constructs her way of life in reciprocity with others, and not merely following, or being shaped by, others. Furthermore, Nussbaum notes that these two capabilities suffuse all the others, and this in turn, constitutes a truly human pursuit.

Furthermore, Nussbaum argues that the list is 'thick,' but 'vague.' It is thick because it provides a specific conception of the good life (that is, human flourishing), however, it is not thick enough that it mandates how one ought to live one's life. Thus, the capabilities list is 'thick' enough to allow us to make cross-cultural judgments (for example, identifying areas where an individual or groups of people are unable to actualize a capability), and yet 'vague' enough for an individual to choose whether or not (or how) she wishes to participate in a capability.

Finally, Nussbaum says that citizens should be guaranteed a social minimum whereby capabilities can be realized. It is the role of institutions to ensure that a threshold level of central capabilities is achieved. Institutions (for example, religious, labor, government, and so forth) come in many forms, and protect various interests. For example, the Self Employed Women's Association (SEWA) helps women provide protection and benefits for work in which they have been traditionally underappreciated. However, as Nussbaum notes, achieving the threshold may not be enough for justice.

4. The Relationship between the Capabilities Approach and Other Ethical Theories

The ethical theories that have dominated Western philosophy include (in one form or another) virtue ethics, consequentialism and deontology. The capabilities cannot be reduced to any of those ethical theories, however, it is indebted more or less to each of them. This section will review Rawls and human rights, both of which have numerous deontological underpinnings, and communitarianism which is closely linked with ethics. Finally, this section will include a section on Michael Boylan's 'table of embeddedness' in order to see the challenges and parallels between it and Nussbaum's list of capabilities. This section will explore parallels and differences between the capabilities approach and the above ethical theories.

a. Virtue Ethics

Even though there are clear differences between the virtue tradition (specifically, Aristotle) and the capabilities approach, Nussbaum uses the former as a point of departure. That is, Aristotle is the foundation for the capabilities approach because Nussbaum seeks a theory that provides the opportunity for human beings to use their powers to flourish in a truly human way.

Virtue ethics, broadly speaking, like the capabilities approach, claims human beings should exercise their powers qua human in attempt in order to live well. Contemporary neo-Aristotelians strive to explicate an account of flourishing  which may entail providing a naturalistic account of flourishing or through empirical psychology. Nussbaum, however, interprets Aristotle's account of functioning as merely a moral concept and not naturalistic). However, unlike other neo-Aristotelians (and Aristotle himself), Nussbaum has no intention of providing a comprehensive doctrine of human flourishing, although, as noted above, she believes she is providing a tentatively comprehensive list of capabilities.

There is another stark contrast between virtue ethics and the capabilities approach–namely, character building and motivation. Nussbaum is less concerned with why people perform certain actions, and building one's character over a period of time through proper motivations, and more concerned with providing the proper space that allows an individual to use her powers to fulfill a capability, if she chooses. One should not mistake this claim to mean that Nussbaum is not concerned with motivation at all, but rather this should be viewed as a shift in emphasis. Nussbaum argues in WHD that informed desires (that is, the justification for the capabilities approach) cannot be any desire, but those which contribute to living well. For example, even though one may fulfill the capability of practical reason through education, one should not use it in such a way that coerces others. Such a desire would be condemned by Nussbaum since, on the one hand, it prevents the coerced person from participating in all the capabilities, and on the other, it does not reflect an informed one.

b. Communitarianism

Communitarianism is a critique of liberal theory, and, on the other, emphasizes the importance of political norms within a community. In brief, liberal theorists contend that a self is ahistorical, asocial and apolitical.  Thus it is not necessarily the case that it will be burdened by the practices and beliefs of its community. Michael Sandel, a nationalist-communitarian, explains that a liberal self is 'unencumbered'–that is, it is not wedded to a particular conception of the good not of its choosing. This abstract ontology allows liberals to make certain moves in the political sphere. For example, the concept of 'justice' entails universal normative claims since all human beings are ontologically the same.

In contrast, Alasdair MacIntyre, a communitarian indebted to Aristotle, argues against liberal political theory beginning with their conception of the self. He says a self is embedded within a particular set of cultural beliefs, practices and history. MacIntyre, following Aristotle, claims that in order for one to live a good life, one must be virtuous. A virtue, according to MacIntyre (2007), is a character trait that allows us to achieve goods that are internal to one’s practices By 'practice,' he is referring to a "socially established cooperative human activity through which goods internal to that form of activity are realized in the course of trying to achieve those standards of excellence...."  Thus, living a good life entails being virtuous within the context of a given practice (or community).

Furthermore, communitarians believe justice is limited to communities rather than human beings at large. This, in turn, allows them to reject the notion that we can make universal normative judgments. Finally, MacIntyre believes we need extend our conception of virtue from the individual to the community. It’s a bit unclear what a virtuous community would look like exactly, however, we know that it would have a conception of the good life in which people strive. This is clearly contrary to the liberal project in which, , individuals pursue whatever conception of the good they wish as long as they do not interfere or harm another.

Nussbaum is sympathetic to communitarianism insofar as it acknowledges the importance of local traditions and practices that shape our lives. For example, a Hindi woman in India will have a set of beliefs that shape who she is that differs from a Protestant male in the United States. However, Nussbaum ultimately rejects communitarianism. In her section entitled "Defending Universal Values" from WHD, she says communitarians fail to recognize that there is a conception of the individual that is not indebted to a particular metaphysical tradition. She argues that each person should be treated as an end, worthy of respect, dignity and honor. As mentioned in section II, Nussbaum believes the capabilities is founded on the intuition that each person is worthy of a dignified life, and this intuition holds irrespective of one's community.

c. Deontology

In putting forth her ancillary justification for the capabilities, Nussbaum is indebted to Jean Hampton's Kantian proceduralism. Nussbaum (2000) believes we need a "Kantian conception of human worth that prominently includes the ideas of equal worth and nonaggregation" (Nussbaum's italics,). There are two points to take from this claim. First, she is indebted to the Kantian notion that all human beings have intrinsic worth, and as a result, they should always be treated as an end and never merely as a means. Second, she is critiquing the consequentialist argument for aggregate utility. We saw her specific problems with this argument immediately above.

Although Nussbaum is clearly indebted to deontology since it is a justification (albeit auxiliary) for the capabilities, there remains questions to what extent Kant plays a role. David Crocker (2008) argues that her Kantian equal-worth commitment is nothing more than an addition onto her Aristotelianism since the latter justifies moral and political inequality.

d. Rawls' The Law of Peoples


John Rawls uses the same methodology (and preserves the liberal ontological framework of ‘autonomy’ and ‘reason’) in The Law of Peoples as in A Theory of Justice however, he has extended justice to a global scale rather than merely nationally. Beginning with the 'global original position,' Rawls argues that all reasonable (or decent) persons would construct political ideals that benefit all liberal peoples; these ideals would be reached via overlapping consensus. See Daniels (1989) and Pogge (1989) for further discussion on Rawls' original position. A liberal, democratic society, according to Rawls (1999), would include the following benefits: (1) fair equality of opportunity–including, education, (2) a decent distribution of income, (3) society as employer of last resort through general or local government, (4) basic health care for all citizens and (5) public financing of elections (p. 50).

Rawls (1999) claims that the policies constructed by liberal peoples should direct non-liberal societies to (ideally) all become liberal. Rawls deems an illiberal society which rejects the possibility of becoming liberal (for example, abiding by human rights regulations) as an 'outlaw state.' While liberal societies should attempt to tolerate illiberal societies initially, he contends an outlaw state eventually subjects itself to severe sanctions and possible intervention

Nussbaum is indebted to not only Rawls specifically, but often praises the values of liberalism. First, she is committed to Rawls' method of 'overlapping consensus' insofar as it is politically advantageous to perform such tasks as fairly distributing primary goods. Furthermore, Nussbaum (2000) respects Rawls attentiveness to "pluralism and paternalism" while remaining committed to the importance of basic liberties Finally, Nussbaum agrees with Rawls (and liberalism more generally) that we should treat people as dignified human beings, and respect their autonomy qua individual.

Nussbaum is also critical of Rawls beginning with his reluctance to make comparisons of well-being. Rawls refuses to make comparisons since each person constructs their conception of the good, so a person may be satisfied with their way of life even though another may find it unsatisfactory. While there may be fears of paternalism, Nussbaum is clear that we should make comparisons of well-being in order to grant certain areas as needing more resources than others. From this, Nussbaum (2000) criticizes Rawls for not taking seriously enough how greatly individuals vary in their needs. Consider her example. If we are concerned with spending resources on increasing literacy rates around the world, we will have to spend much more on women than men given the discrepancy between them. However, Nussbaum argues that Rawls’ approach could not properly address the obstacles when distributing resources since he is merely concerned with resource-distribution, and not cognizant of the variations of distribution within a particular region.

e. Human Rights

The rhetoric of human rights has arguably been more powerful than any other approach to global justice. There is debate amongst human rights advocates in regards to the origin of rights, how they are manifested (that is, who possess them), their possibility of group distribution and how they ought to be enforced. Nonetheless, human rights are universal political norms that belong to every individual simply in virtue of being human. It does not matter whether one belongs to one affiliation or another; but merely in virtue of being a human being, she is guaranteed minimal norms (for example, the right to life or liberty). These are minimal insofar as they are not connected with any conception of the good life, and thus, do not preclude any groups of people (or communities). For further discussion on the nature of human rights see Griffin (2008) and Donnelly (2003).

Alan Gewirth, in The Community of Rights, attempts to make human rights compatible with communities. We can see the difficulty of such a task given the commitment the communitarianism theorists have to a common good, on the one hand, and a value-neutral approach from rights, on the other. Nonetheless, Gewirth argues that if a community does not uphold a doctrine of human rights, then it ought to be rejected as a legitimate community. Gewirth puts forth a theory of human rights while respecting the role communities play in our lives. Furthermore, Will Kymlicka (1989) extends the concept of rights by constructing a theory of rights that considers communities or group rights.

In WHD, Nussbaum directly addresses the "very close" relationship between human rights and the capabilities approach. She believes the capabilities approach has advantages over human rights insofar as it can take a clear position on issues the latter cannot in addition to providing a clear goal. For example, human rights theorists often disagree on the origin and foundation of rights, whereas the capabilities approach, according to Nussbaum, is not plagued by such criticisms. She raises two concerns for why we should reject human rights in favor of the capabilities approach, and then provides four key roles for human rights.

Nussbaum first claims that human rights proponents often make rights claims in regards to property or economic advantage (for example, they have a right to shelter). However, in converting a language of rights to capabilities, she explains that this statement becomes problematic insofar as it can be understood in many ways including resources, utility and capabilities. The human rights tradition would discuss it in terms of resources; however, merely providing resources does not necessarily raise everyone to the same level of capability in order to allow them to fulfill their function. Second, the language of capability ethics does not contain all the baggage that pertains to human rights.  Although Nussbaum rejects the understanding that human rights are often characterized as simply being Western, she also says the capabilities approach avoids the troubles surrounding this debate.

Even though Nussbaum is critical of human rights, she believes is plays an essential role in global ethics. She presents the following four roles (or advantages) of human rights. First, human rights have the advantage of showing the urgency to claims of injustice. Second, human rights (as of now) have rhetorical power. Third, human rights place value on people's autonomy. Finally, human rights preserve a sense of agreement insofar as it purports norms that apply to everyone.

f. Consequentialism

It would be easy to mistake the capabilities approach as a consequentialist argument to increase the overall utility in the world, where 'utility' can be understood in many ways–including 'happiness.' Peter Singer (1972), in his influential work, "Famine, Affluence and Morality," puts forth arguments fighting global poverty from a consequentialist standpoint. In sum, he argues through a series of objections and replies that those in positions of material power should donate to those in less favorable conditions in order to increase the overall utility (and ultimately decrease poverty) throughout the world. It can be said that that Singer's consequentialism and the capabilities approach are similar insofar as they both more or less seek to directly reduce poverty, and furthermore, provide more opportunities for those who have few or none.

However, Nussbaum (2000) provides three reasons for why consequentialism is different from the capabilities approach. First, one major difference is for whom the ethical theory accounts. On the one hand, consequentialism is interested in maximizing the utility of everyone (that is, the aggregate). On the other, the capabilities approach is interested in the individual. For example, Nussbaum says that the aggregative solution does not tell us who are the bottom and top, that is, who has control over material goods and whether or not someone else deserves a share of it. Thus, by focusing on the individual, we are able to best identify who needs resources and how much.

Second, related to the above point, consequentialism tends to ignore cross-cultural differences, that is, ignoring the fact that people live vastly different lives. As consequentialism is concerned with overall utility (and not merely particular persons or groups of people), it may ignore a particular good that is minimized in one culture, but widely present in another. Put differently, there are many goods–including education and religion–that are highly important to some and relatively unimportant to others. Consequentialism aggregates all goods under the heading of 'utility,' and thus, we are unable to identify which goods must be properly distributed to a particular region. The capabilities approach, however, is not only interested in allowing groups of people to use their power to fulfill a capability, but in each individual person to partake in a capability.

Finally, consequentialism ignores relevant aspects of individuals including emotions (that is, how individuals feel about what is happening to them) and what they are able to do or be (that is, fulfill a capability). This critique tends to be associated with consequentialism at large (and not specifically from the capabilities approach), but it is still worth noting. Since the capabilities strive for human flourishing, which entails the ability to express emotions without fear, we can understand why Nussbaum reiterates this critique.

g. Boylan’s Table of Embeddedness

Michael Boylan, in A Just Society, presents a 'table of embeddedness,' which is meant to describe a hierarchy of goods. Boylan's argument for the table can be seen as follows: if people desire to be good, and becoming good requires action, then all people desire to act; the following table presents the interconnectedness between Boylan's preconditions for actions and a hierarchy of goods.

Boylan (2004) splits the table into two levels–basic goods and secondary goods. The former, on the one hand, is broken further into 'most deeply embedded' goods (for example, food, clothing, shelter and free from being harmed) and 'deeply embedded' goods (for example, literate, basic math skills, treated with self-respect, and so forth). On the other hand, Boylan divides the latter into 'life enhancing' goods (for example, societal respect, equal opportunity and equal political participation), 'useful' goods (for example, property, gain from one's labor and pursue goods owned by the general public such as a cell phone) and 'luxurious' goods (for example, pursue pleasant goods such as vacationing and use one's will to possess a large portion of society's resources). Even though society has no duty to provide 'useful' or 'luxurious' goods, it has an obligation to provide basic goods and life enhancing goods (from the secondary goods) to its members. Finally, in striving for equal respect, Boylan claims society may have to spend greater resources on those who are disadvantaged; in doing so Nussbaum would be sympathetic to Boylan's claim that some groups of people require disproportionally more resources given their unfortunate circumstances than another. This was her critique of Rawls–namely, that he did not account for the varying needs of individuals. Furthermore, Nussbaum would also grant that society has an obligation to provide its citizens with Boylan's basic goods such as food, shelter and water. However, the roles in which each list plays will be different given how their respective authors understand its purpose.

Nussbaum's list, unlike Boylan’s, is not hierarchal, but rather everyone ought to have equal opportunity to perform a function that fulfills a capability. In other words, no capability, according to Nussbaum, is more essential than another. Marcus Düwell (2009) provides two criticisms of this view. First, he claims a lack of hierarchy of goods (or capabilities) raises concerns about its practical guidance in "morally contested topics." Even though Nussbaum argues that no primacy should be given to a particular capability, it's worth noting that it would be difficult to fulfill the capability of 'bodily integrity,' for example, if one's capability of life is taken away. Second, it also raises concerns to what extent the capabilities are "foundational moral obligations for others."

5. Philosophical Criticisms of the Capabilities Approach

The capabilities approach has endured many criticisms since its inception. The primary critique is constructed from the feminist and non-Western perspective. This entry will focus on Alison Jaggar's critique since it embodies many concerns of power relations. Meanwhile, the latter critique can be found in many theorists, but the focus of this entry will be limited to Bernard Williams since he puts forth two challenges in attempt to seek the nature of a capability. Jaggar's criticisms are limited to Nussbaum, and Williams' critique is directed primarily towards Sen. This will provide a greater array of criticisms for the capabilities theory in general.

a. Illiberal and Neo-Colonialist

Alison Jaggar criticizes both Nussbaum's justifications for the capabilities approach and her list. Jaggar believes Nussbaum may have ignored power asymmetries that exist between not only men and women, but also Western and non-Western peoples. She argues that the intuitionist and proceduralist justifications seem to be neo-colonialist and illiberal.

First, Jaggar (2006) argues that Nussbaum's theory appears to be neo-colonialist insofar as those in power have the "final assess the moral worth of...[other's] voices". This is problematic for the intuitionist justification since those who possess intuitions that do not match the capabilities list, for example, will be interpreted and possibly jettisoned. Put differently, there are no mechanisms in Nussbaum's approach that allow us to encourage self-criticism from those who possess the list. Furthermore, Jaggar emphasizes that Nussbaum is committed to a politically liberal project (that is, considering everyone's intuitions), however, the intuitionist justification paradoxically dismisses ideas that do not match the theory put forth by Nussbaum, and thus, it illiberally disregards others. In order for Nussbaum’s theory to encourage self-criticism, she must include all intuitions.

Second, the capabilities list seems to be illiberal since "other voices" (that is, mistaken or uninformed desires) are not ready for a proceduralist justification. Since Nussbaum demands only informed desires participate in the proceduralist justification for the list, desires that do not match the list will be unable to partake in the discourse. Furthermore, because these voices are silenced, there may be capabilities missing from the list or capabilities on the list that ought to be challenged. Regardless, they will be left untouched.

In sum, Jaggar criticizes Nussbaum's justifications for the capabilities approach since they ignore asymmetrical power relationships. Jaggar believes that even though Nussbaum claims to be paying attention to such relations, she paradoxically fails to produce a theory that yields an outcome that is cognizant of power. It's worth noting, though, that Jaggar does not believe these criticisms ultimately entail rejecting the capabilities. Rather, she believes that placing discourse ethics as the main justification for the capabilities may allow the theory to be self-critical, and thus, fully aware of power dynamics.

b. What Is a Capability?

Williams' (1987) primary concern of the capabilities approach is trying to understand what is meant by a 'capability.' In pursuing this inquiry, he believes Sen in particular, but capabilities proponents in general, are unclear on the relationship between 'choice' and 'capability.' Williams does not provide knock-down arguments against the capabilities, but rather poses two challenges for the capabilities theorist to consider.

First, Williams asks what it means to have the capability to do X? Consider his example. If a person is posted once a year to a desirable holiday resort, does she have the capability to go? In a trivial sense, "yes," but not in a meaningful way (that is, in a way that contributes to the well-being of an individual). If the term 'capability' is understood merely as 'possibility,' then it could be granted that she has the capability to go, although, there is still something missing–namely, the ability to choose whether or not to go. This example is meant to illustrate the correlation between capabilities and choice. That is, according to Williams, in this case a capability cannot exist without the option to choose it. However, consider Sen's example where a capability exists without the ability to choose it. Sen, in his Tanner Lectures, notes that the life expectancy is higher in China than India. He believes this example shows that the higher one's life expectancy the higher the capability of a standard of living. In response to this claim William asks, what capability is increased by a greater life expectancy? He poses this question since it might be the case that living longer only contributes to one having more time to contemplate whether to commit suicide. In this example, Williams is pointing out the problems with the relationship of a capability that completely lacks choice.

Second, and related to the above challenge, William questions the relationship of the capability of doing X to the actual ability to do X here and now. He notes that the 'actual ability to do X' can be understood as 'can do X.' In other words, if a person possesses the capability to do X, then it must be the case that she can do X. Consider Sen's example of the capability of breathing unpolluted air. He would argue that if a person has the capability to breathe unpolluted air, then she can do so. Williams grants that a person living in Los Angeles cannot breathe unpolluted air here and now, however, that is not to say she cannot do so at all. In other words, this person has the capability to breathe unpolluted air, but she cannot do it here and now; this position is contrary, though, to Sen's claim above that if one has the capability to do X, she can do X. Because she has the capability to breathe unpolluted air, she should move to a place where it is possible to do so. Williams argues, though, that there are large costs associated with moving to a place where she can breathe unpolluted air. Let's assume that person does not have the economic means to do so. Does this person really have the capability, then, to breathe unpolluted air?–logically speaking, "yes," however, certainly not in any meaningful sense. By considering the opportunity costs associated with a capability such as breathing unpolluted air, some capabilities may become nearly impossible for many to acquire. Thus, Williams argues it is not simply because one can do X that one has the capability to do X.

6. Philosophical Applications

The capabilities approach is often discussed in terms of providing opportunities (Sen) and using human powers (Nussbaum). More often than not it is an argument to reduce poverty or increase the well-being of people around the globe. Recently, it has provided the framework to further advance arguments in other areas of applied ethics including business ethics, the environment, disability ethics and animal ethics. This entry will merely focus on the environment and disability ethics because it calls attention to how far the capabilities approach can be extended.

a. The Environment

The biggest challenge facing capabilities theorists in regards to the environment is on the area of emphasis. The goal of the capabilities–whether Sen or Nussbaum–is human flourishing or well-being. It is never simply understood as non-human or ecological flourishing. Of course, this is not to say that the capabilities approach has nothing to say about the environment, or worse, that it must harm it in order for human beings to flourish, although, there are obstacles standing in the way when putting forth not only an environmentally friendly capabilities approach, but one in which environmental flourishing is taken just as seriously as human flourishing.

There seems to be two ways in which we can approach environmental ethics from a capabilities perspective. By briefly examining each solution, we will have a broader perspective of how the capabilities approach begins to asses environmental concerns. First, one may begin with the capabilities list, and show how environmental values relate to human flourishing. Recall Nussbaum's eighth capability (out of ten): Other species have the ability to have a concern for and live with others animals, plants and the environment at large. There are two points we can take from this capability. First, Nussbaum believes the environment clearly plays a role in human flourishing otherwise she would not have included it as a capability. Even though the environment seems to be playing an instrumental role insofar as it contributes to human flourishing, it is nonetheless an essential capability. Furthermore, Nussbaum's list is beneficial because she believes it should be implemented as public policy which would force countries that do not take the environmental capability seriously to reconsider their current policies. Second, however, Victoria Kamsler (2006) recalls that she places it eighth on the list which, she argues, is hard to deny that it is given less emphasis than on almost all the other capabilities. In defense of Nussbaum, she notes that all the capabilities are meant to be mutually reinforcing, and thus, the dignity of a human being as truly human cannot be met without taking environment flourishing seriously.

Second, rather than starting with the list and placing instrumental value on the environment, one may begin with a general account of flourishing that can be applied to non-human beings such as animals and the environment. Here, the environment is understood as being intrinsically valuable (that is, valuable independent of human beings). Kamsler notes that Nussbaum believes the "most basic intuition behind [the] capability theory... 'wants to see each thing flourish as the sort of thing that it is'". In other words, the environment qua capability must be treated as an entity that must flourish in its own right, and not merely for the value it provides human beings.

There still remains a lingering question about the relationship between the environment and the capabilities approach. If the capability is understood as anthropocentric insofar as it is concerned with human flourishing, what should we do when the environment impedes such flourishing? In other words, there seem to be cases in which being concerned with the environment's flourishing will directly conflict with human flourishing (for example, the capability of work and protecting forests). Kamsler addresses this conflict when she says that the only way to overcome this seemingly tragic dilemma is through technological and political means. This is not to say that it will not be costly or conflict with other capabilities, but it is a solution that goes beyond being complacent with the dilemma.

b. Disability Ethics

A person cannot be said to flourish, according to the capabilities approach, if she is unable to perform functions that partake in the capabilities. This raises interesting questions with people who have disabilities insofar as they may be either physically or mentally impaired from having the ability to perform many functions. Nussbaum has given this topic ample discussion through her Tanner Lectures and various publications.

Nussbaum addresses the question of disabilities via the capabilities approach through her list. Her early formulation of the capabilities list excluded many people from the ability to live a truly human life since she required such a life to include using all five senses, for example. She has since retracted from such bold statements. However, Nussbaum (1995) does note that it would be difficult to imagine a person living a truly human life with total lack of the senses, imagination and reasoning.

Nussbaum (2002) has extended her account of functioning in a truly human way (that is, for human dignity) "as containing many different types of animal dignity, all of which deserve respect and even wonder". In other words, she believes the mentally disabled can gain dignity not merely from rationality, but also through support for the "capabilities of life, health, and bodily integrity. It will also provide stimulation for senses, imagination and thought" This passage indicates a clear responsibility on the state to not only allow for such stimulation of the senses to occur, but to actually provide the resources for such stimulation to occur.

There are interesting questions about how to implement policies that provide the best opportunity for disabled peoples to perform functions that fulfill capabilities. Nussbaum heralds the Individuals with Disabilities Education Act (IDEA) as a way to understand how the capabilities can be manifested in the current education system. IDEA is a disabilities act that begins with the idea of human individuality. Instead of lumping all disabled students into one group, each student is taken on a case-by-case basis. This approach in turn, allows for each student to receive the proper care she needs. This Act does not focus on education being a 'human right' because that would entail the goal of merely providing an education to the student, that is, ensuring she receives an education in one form or another. What makes this Act uniquely indebted to the capabilities is its commitment to providing the opportunity for the students to use their powers qua human beings to fulfill their functions in a truly human way–for example, via their senses, imagination and thought.

7. United Nations Development Program

The UNDP is an organization built on the theoretical principles of the capabilities approach. Its goals include helping countries best address solutions pertaining to democratic governance, poverty reduction, crisis prevention and recovery, environment and energy and HIV/AIDS. The organization is clear that none of these solutions will ever come at the expense of women since they are an advocate of empowering women. The four solutions listed here are designed to assist the various challenges facing nations. However, there are eight concrete goals the UNDP is interested in achieving.

The UNDP has put forth eight Millennium Development Goals (MDGs). The MDGs include the following: (1) eradicate extreme poverty and hunger, (2) achieve universal primary education, (3) promote gender equality and empower women, (4) reduce child mortality, (5) improve maternal health, (6) combat HIV/AIDS, malaria and other diseases, (7) ensure environmental sustainability and (8) develop a global partnership for development. The success or failure of achieving these goals is based on a measurement from the Human Development Report (HDR).

The HDR is designed to measure the ways in which people can live up to their full potential in accordance with their desires and interests. Mahbub ul Haq, founder of the HDR, says "the basic purpose of development is to enlarge people's choices...[which include] greater access to knowledge, better nutrition and health services, more secure livelihoods, security against crime and physical violence, satisfying leisure hours, political and cultural freedoms and sense of participation in community activities." There are two points to take from this. First, it is clear that the theoretical aspects of the capabilities approach have been preserved upon measuring the MDGs. Second, the HDR is not committed to merely measuring wealth, but rather providing the opportunities for a person to fulfill any of the capabilities she is interested in pursuing.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Appiah, Kwame A. (2006) Cosmopolitanism: Ethics in a World of Strangers, W.W. Norton: NY.
  • Benhabib, Seyla (1995) "Cultural Complexity, Moral Interdependence, and the Global Dialogical Community" in Women, Culture and Development, Martha C. Nussbaum and Jonathan Glover (eds.), Clarendon Press: Oxford.
  • Boylan, Micahel (2004) A Just Society, Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc: Lanham, MD.
  • Crocker, David (2008) Ethics of Global Development: Agency, Capability and Deliberative Democracy, Cambridge University Press: NY.
  • Daniels, Norman (1989) Reading Rawls: Critical Studies on Rawls' "A Theory of Justice," Stanford University Press: Stanford, CA.
  • Donnelly, Jack (2003) Universal Human Rights in Theory and Practice, Cornell University Press: Ithaca.
  • Düwell, Marcus (2009) "On the Possibility of a Hierarchy of Moral Goods," in Morality and Justice: Reading Boylan's A Just Society, John-Steward Gordon (ed.), Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc: Lanham, MD.
  • Gewirth, Alan (1978) Reason and Morality, The University of Chicago Press: Chicago, IL.
  • Gewirth, Alan (1996) The Community of Rights, The University of Chicago Press: Chicago, IL.
  • Griffin, James (2008) On Human Rights, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
  • Jaggar, Alison (2006) "Reasoning About Well-Being: Nussbaum's Methods of Justifying the Capabilities," The Journal of Political Philosophy, 14:3, 301-322.
  • Kymlicka, Will (1989) Liberalism, Community and Culture, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair (1988) Whose Justice? Which Rationality?, University of Notre Dame Press, Notre Dame, IN.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair (2007) After Virtue, Notre Dame University Press: Notre Dame, IN.
  • Nussbaum, Martha (1995), "Human Capabilities, Female Human Beings," in Women, Culture, and Development: A Study of Human Capabilities, Martha C. Nussbaum and Jonathan Glover (eds.), Clarendon Press: Oxford.
  • Nussbaum, Martha (2000) Women and Human Development: The Capabilities Approach, Cambridge University Press: Cambridge, MA.
  • Nussbaum, Martha (2002) "Capabilities and Disabilities: Justice for Mentally Disabled Citizens," Philosophical Topics, 30:2, 133-165.
  • O’Neill, Onora (1996) Towards Justice and Virtue: A Constructive Account of Practical Reason, Cambridge University Press: Cambridge, MA.
  • Pogge, Thomas W. (1989) Realizing Rawls, Cornell University Press, Ithaca.
  • Rawls, John (1999) A Theory of Justice, Harvard University Press: Cambridge, MA.
  • Rawls, John (1999) The Law of Peoples, Harvard University Press: Cambridge, MA.
  • Sandel, Michael (1996) Democracy's Discontent: America in Search of a Public Philosophy, Harvard University Press: Cambridge, MA.
  • Sandel, Michael J. (1982) Liberalism and the Limits of Justice, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.
  • Sen, A. K. (1985) "Well-being, Agency and Freedom: the Dewey Lectures," Journal of Philosophy, 82:4, 169-221.
  • Sen, Amartya K. (1987) The Standard of Living: The Tanner Lectures, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sen, Amartya (2009) The Idea of Justice, Harvard University Press: Cambridge, MA.
  • Singer, Peter (1972) "Famine, Affluence, and Morality," Philosophy and Public Affairs, 1:1, 229-243.
  • Kamsler, Victoria (2006) "Attending to nature: capabilities and the environment," in Capabilities Equality: Basic issues and problems (ed.) Alexander Kaufman, Routledge: NY, 198-213.
  • Williams, Bernard (1987), "The Standard of Living: Interests and Capabilities," in The Standard of Living (ed.), Geoffrey Hawthorn, Cambridge University Press: Cambridge, 94-102.

Author Information

Chad Kleist
Marquette University
U. S. A.

Autonomy: Normative

Autonomy is variously rendered as self-law, self-government, self-rule, or self-determination. The concept first came into prominence in ancient Greece (from the Greek auto-nomos), where it characterized city states that were self governing. Only later–during the European Enlightenment–did autonomy come to be widely understood as a property of persons. Today the concept is used in both senses, although most contemporary philosophers deal with autonomy primarily as a property of persons.  This orientation will be maintained here.

Most people would agree that autonomy is normatively important. This agreement is reflected both in the presence of broad assent to the principle that autonomy deserves respect, and in the popular practice of arguing for the institution (or continuation, or discontinuation) of public policy based in some way on the value of self-determination. Many also believe that developing and cultivating autonomy is an important–indeed, on some accounts, an indispensable–part of living a good life. But although the claim that autonomy is normatively significant in some way is intuitively compelling, it is not obvious why autonomy has this significance, or what weight autonomy-based considerations should be given in relation to competing normative considerations. In order to answer these questions with sufficient rigor, it is necessary to have a more detailed understanding of what autonomy is.

This article will be devoted to canvassing the leading work done by philosophers on these two issues, beginning with the question of the nature of autonomy, and then moving to the question of the normative significance of autonomy. It will be seen that autonomy has been understood in several different ways, that it has been claimed to have normative significance of various kinds, and that it has been employed in a wide range of philosophical issues. Special attention will be paid to the question of justification of the principle of respect for autonomous choice.

Table of Contents

  1. History of the Concept of Autonomy
  2. Conceptions of Autonomy
    1. Moral Autonomy
    2. Existentialist Autonomy
    3. Personal Autonomy
    4. Autonomy as a Right
  3. The Normative Roles of Autonomy
    1. Autonomy in Ethical Theory
    2. Autonomy in Applied Ethics
    3. Autonomy in Political Philosophy
    4. Autonomy in Philosophy of Education
  4. Warrant for the Principle of Respect for Autonomous Choice
  5. References and Further Reading

1. History of the Concept of Autonomy

The concept of autonomy first came into prominence in ancient Greece, where it characterized self-governing city-states. Barring one exception (mentioned below), autonomy was not explicitly predicated of persons, although there is reason to hold that many philosophers of that time had something similar in mind when they wrote of persons being guided or ruled by reason. Plato and Aristotle, for example–as well as many of the Stoics–surely would have agreed that a person ruled by reason is a properly self-governing or self-ruling person. What one does not find, however, are ancient philosophers speaking of the ideal of autonomy as that of living according to one’s unique individuality. The one exception to this appears to be found in the thinker and orator Dio of Prusa (ca. 50–ca. 120), who, in his 80th Discourse, clearly seems to predicate autonomy of individual persons in roughly the sense in which it has come to be understood in our own day (see Cooper 2003).

Medieval philosophers made no use of the concept of autonomy that is worthy of note, although once again, many medieval philosophers would have doubtless agreed that those who live in accordance with right reason and the will of God are properly self-governing. The concept of autonomy wouldn’t be circulated in learned circles again until the Renaissance and early modern times, when it was employed both in the traditional political sense, and in an ecclesiastical sense, to refer to churches that were–or at least claimed to be –independent of the authority of the Roman Catholic Pope (see Pohlmann 1971).

The concept of autonomy came into philosophical prominence for the first time with the work of Immanuel Kant. Kant’s work on autonomy, however, was strongly influenced by the writings of Jean-Jacques Rousseau, so a brief word on Rousseau is in order.  Although Rousseau did not use the term ‘autonomy’ in his writings, his conception of moral freedom–defined as “obedience to the law one has prescribed to oneself”– has a clear relation to Kant’s understanding of autonomy (as will be shown below). Moreover, Rousseau wrote of moral freedom as a property of persons, thus presaging Kant’s predication of autonomy of persons. The connections between Rousseau and Kant cannot be taken too far, however; for Rousseau was primarily concerned with the question of how moral freedom can be achieved and sustained by individuals within society given the presence of relations of social dependency and the possibility of domination, whereas Kant was primarily concerned with the place of autonomy in accounts of the subjective conditions requisite for, and the nature of, morality. Because of the connections Kant drew between autonomy and morality, Kant’s conception of autonomy is sometimes referred to as ‘moral autonomy’.

In the nineteenth century, John Stuart Mill contributed to the discussion on the normative significance of autonomy in his work On Liberty. Although Mill did not use the term ‘autonomy’ in this work, he is widely understood as having had self-determination in mind. Mill’s work continues to have considerable influence on discussions on the normative significance of autonomy in relation to paternalism of various kinds.

A tremendous amount of research on autonomy has taken place in the last several decades in both the analytic and continental traditions. Continental philosophers speak more often of authenticity than of autonomy, but there are clear connections between the two, insofar as the ‘self’ in ‘self-determination’ is plausibly understood as the authentic self. Philosophers working in the analytic tradition have gone into great detail attempting to discern necessary and sufficient conditions for the presence of autonomy, as well as to uncover the ground and implications of its normative significance.

2. Conceptions of Autonomy

There are several different conceptions of autonomy, all of which are loosely based upon the core notions of self-government or self-determination, but which differ considerably in the details.

a. Moral Autonomy

As mentioned, moral autonomy is associated with the work of Kant, and is also referred to as ‘autonomy of the will’ or ‘Kantian autonomy.’ This form of autonomy consists in the capacity of the will of a rational being to be a law to itself, independently of the influence of any property of objects of volition. More specifically, an autonomous will is said to be free in both a negative and a positive sense. The will is negatively free in that it operates entirely independently of alien influences, including all contingent empirical determinations associated with appetite, desire-satisfaction, or happiness. The will is positively free in that it can act in accordance with its own law. Kant’s notion of autonomy of the will thus involves, as Andrews Reath has written, “not only a capacity for choice that is motivationally independent, but a lawgiving capacity that is independent of determination by external influence and is guided by its own internal principle–in other words, by a principle that is constitutive of lawgiving” (Reath 2006).  Now, because the lawgiving of the autonomous will contains no content given by contingent empirical influences, this lawgiving must be universal; and because these laws are the product of practical reason, they are necessary. Insofar, then, as Kant understood moral laws as universal and necessary practical laws, it can be seen why Kant posited an essential connection between the possession of autonomy and morality: the products of the autonomous will are universal and necessary practical laws–that is, moral laws. It is thus by virtue of our autonomy that we are capable of morality, and we are moral to the extent that we are autonomous. It is for this reason that Kant’s conception of autonomy is described as moral autonomy. Moral autonomy refers to the capacity of rational agents to impose upon themselves–to legislate for themselves–the moral law.

Furthermore, the capacity for autonomy, according to Kant, is “the basis of the dignity of human and of every rational nature;” and in accordance with this rational nature, is an end in itself. Furthermore, it “restricts freedom of action, and is an object of respect”. Many thinkers have followed Kant in grounding the dignity of persons (and respect for persons generally) in our capacity for autonomy (although it should be noted that not all of these thinkers have accepted Kant’s conception of autonomy). More will be said on this below.

Moral autonomy is said to be a bivalent property possessed by all rational beings by virtue of their rationality–although according to Kant, it is certainly possible not to live in accordance with its deliverances in practice (for more on Kant’s conception of autonomy, see Hill 1989, Guyer 2003, and Reath 2006).

One of the most common objections to this conception of autonomy is that such a robust form of independence from contingent empirical influences is not possible. Kant defended the possibility of such robust independence by arguing that human agents inhabit two realms at once: the phenomenal realm of experience, in relation to which we are determined; and a noumenal or transcendental realm of the intellect, in relation to which we are free. Given the further claim that our noumenal self can exercise efficient causality in the phenomenal realm, Kant held that our autonomy is in large part constituted by our noumenal freedom. The postulation of such a form of freedom may be criticized as metaphysically extravagant, however; and if such freedom is not possible, then neither is moral autonomy in Kant’s strict sense. Some thinkers have argued that Kant’s theorization on the noumenal realm was not meant to have metaphysical significance. Thomas Hill has argued, for example, that Kant may have been merely elaborating on the practical conditions in which we must understand ourselves insofar as we conceive ourselves as free. Objectors have insisted, however, that Kant intended to assert the more robust form of metaphysical freedom. Indeed, it could be pressed, he must have; for without this sense of freedom being operative, actual autonomy–and hence morality, by Kant’s lights–would not be possible.

b. Existentialist Autonomy

Existentialist autonomy is an extreme form of autonomy associated principally with the writings of Jean Paul Sartre. It refers to the complete freedom of subjects to determine their natures and guiding principles independently of any forms of social, anthropological or moral determination. To possess existentialist autonomy is thus to be able to choose one’s nature without constraint from any principles not of one’s own choosing. Sartre held this radical freedom to be entailed by the truth of atheism. According to Sartre, God’s nonexistence entails two key conclusions: firstly, humans cannot have a predetermined nature; and secondly, there cannot exist a realm of values possessing independent validity. Taken together, this entails that human beings are radically free: “For if indeed existence precedes essence, one will never be able to explain one’s action by reference to a given and specific human nature; in other words, there is no determinism–man is free, man is freedom. Nor, on the other hand, if God does not exist, are we provided with any values or commands that could legitimize our behavior. Thus we have neither behind us, nor before us in a luminous realm of values, any means of justification or excuse.”  Fettered neither by a predetermined nature nor by an independently existing order of values, “[m]an is nothing else but what he makes of himself” (Sartre 1946).

Like moral autonomy, existentialist autonomy is a bivalent property which all human persons are said to possess (although possibly without being aware of this). Unlike moral autonomy, however, existentialist autonomy has no necessary connections to morality or to rationality as traditionally conceived.

The primary objection to existentialist autonomy is that it is too radical to be plausible.  Even if God does not exist, it is argued, it does not follow that humans lack a nature that determines–at least to some extent–their choices, tendencies, proclivities, and guiding principles. A thoroughly naturalistic conception of human nature, informed by an understanding of the evolutionary forces operative in human psychology, seems to militate against the notion that humans are as unbounded as existentialist autonomy suggests we are. At the very least, it could be argued that empirical evidence does not speak in favor of the existence of existentialist autonomy in any robust form.

c. Personal Autonomy

Without question, the majority of contemporary work on autonomy has centered on analyses of the nature and normativity of personal autonomy. Personal autonomy (also referred to as ‘individual autonomy’) refers to a psychological property, the possession of which enables agents to reflect critically on their natures, preferences and ends, to locate their most authentic commitments, and to live consistently in accordance with these in the face of various forms of internal and external interference. Personally autonomous agents are said to possess heightened capacities for self-control, introspection, independence of judgment, and critical reflection; and to this extent personal autonomy is often put forth as an ideal of character or a virtue, the opposite of which is blind conformity, or not ‘being one’s own person.’

As mentioned above, personal autonomy has an essential relation to authenticity: the personally autonomous agent is the agent who is effective in determining her life in accordance with her authentic self. Personal autonomy is thus constituted, on the one hand, by a cluster of related capacities (often termed ‘authenticity conditions’), centered on identifying one’s authentic nature or preferences and, on the other hand, by a cluster of capacities (often termed ‘competency conditions’) that are centered on being able effectively to live in accordance with these throughout one’s life in the face of various recalcitrant foreign influences. These capacities may be possessed singly or in unison, and often require a considerable amount of life experience to assume robust forms.

One of the most intractable problems surrounding personal autonomy concerns the analysis of the authentic self (the ‘self’ in ‘self-determination’, as it were).  Some philosophers have claimed that no such self exists; and indeed, some philosophers claim that no self exists at all (for an overview of these problems, see Friedman 2003 and Mackenzie & Stoljar 2000).  Most philosophers accept the possibility of the authentic self at least as a working hypothesis, however, and concentrate attention on the question of how authenticity is secured by an agent. The most popular and influential account is based on the work of Harry Frankfurt and Gerald Dworkin. According to their ‘hierarchical’ account, agents validate the various commitments (beliefs, values, desires, and so forth) that constitute their selves as their own by a process of reflective endorsement. On this account, agents are said to possess first-order and second-order volitions. Our first-order volitions are what we want; and our second-order volitions are what we want to want. According to the hierarchical model, our first-order desires, commitments, and so on are authentic when they are validated by being in harmony with our second-order volitions: that is, when we want what we want to want. Following from this model, an agent is autonomous in relation to a given object when the agent is able to determine her first-order volitions (and corresponding behavior) by her second-order volitions. A simple example may help to illustrate the model. Say that I am a smoker. Although I enjoy lighting up, I do not reflectively endorse my smoking; I desire it, but I do not want to desire it. On the hierarchical model, smoking is not an aspect of my authentic self, because I do not reflectively endorse it; and to the extent that I am unable to change my habits, I am not autonomous in relation to smoking. Conversely, if I can bring my first-order volitions into harmony (or identity) with my second-order volition, then my desire is authentic because it is reflectively endorsed; and to the extent that I can mold my behavior in accordance with my reflective will, I am autonomous in relation to smoking.  Persons who possess the requisite capacities to form authentic desires and effectively to generally live in accordance with them are autonomous agents according to this model (see Frankfurt 1971, 1999 and Dworkin 1988).

The hierarchical model remains–in outline, at least–the leading account of authenticity undergirding most contemporary accounts of personal autonomy, although it has been attacked on many fronts. The primary objection tendered against this account is ‘the problem of origins.’ As we have seen, authentic selfhood as reflective endorsement holds that my authentic self is the self that I reflectively ratify: the self that I endorse as expressing, in a deep sense, who I fundamentally am or wish to be. The problem of origins arises when one attempts to explain how this act of reflective endorsement actually constitutes a break from other-determination (that is, from foreign influence). For, could it not be the case that what appears to me to be an independent act of reflective endorsement is itself conditioned by other-determining factors and therefore ultimately an other-determined act? If this is the case, then it doesn’t seem that the possession of autonomy or the making of autonomous choices is possible. In short, the problem is how to sustain an account of self-determination that is not threatened by the pervasive effects of other-determination (see Taylor 2005 for elaboration on the problem of origins and related sub-problems). Much work on theories of personal autonomy has been explicitly devoted to addressing precisely these sorts of difficulties.

Besides analyzing and clarifying the authenticity conditions necessary for autonomy, philosophers have also worked on providing a thorough account of the competency conditions necessary for the presence of autonomy (see Meyers 1989, Mele 1993, and Berofsky 1995). Competency conditions, as we have seen, are those capacities or conditions that need to be present in order for one to be effective in living according to one’s authentic self-conception in the face of various kinds of interference to that end.  Examples of competency conditions include self-control, logical aptitude, instrumental rationality, resolve, temperance, calmness, and a good memory.

In addition to authenticity and competency conditions, many theories of personal autonomy require the presence of certain external enabling conditions: that is, external or environmental (social, legal, familial, and so forth) conditions which are more than less out of the agent’s control, but which must be in place in order for fully autonomous living to be possible. Such enabling conditions include, for example, a modicum of social freedom, an array of substantive options for choice, the presence of authenticity-oriented social relations, and autonomy-supporting networks of social recognition and acknowledgment (see Raz 1986 and Anderson & Honneth 2005). Without these conditions, effective autonomous living is said by some to be impossible, even where authenticity and competency conditions are robustly satisfied. Different autonomy theorists place different emphases on external enabling conditions. Some contend that external enabling is a necessary condition for autonomy (see Oshana 1998). Others hold that autonomy more properly concerns agential satisfaction of authenticity and competency conditions, regardless of whether the external environment allows for actual autonomous expression (see Christman 2007). Both views can claim some intuitive support. On the one hand, it is reasonable to hold that it is only fitting to call a person ‘autonomous’ if that person is in fact effective in living according to her authentic self-conception. Yet, it also makes sense to call persons ‘autonomous’ who have formed an authentic self-conception and possess the requisite competency conditions effectively to express that self-conception, but happen to lack the contingent socio-relational conditions that allow for the expression of that authentic self. A possible solution to this impasse may be to avoid seeking hard and fast borders to the existence of autonomy, and say that autonomy is present in both cases, but is more robust where the proper external enabling conditions are in place.

The question of normative commitments associated with personal autonomy possession has also been a matter of some dispute. Many philosophers hold that autonomy is normatively content-neutral. According to this account, one (or one’s commitments) can be autonomous regardless of the values one endorses. On this account, one could commit to any kind of life–even the life of a slave–and still be autonomous (see, for example, Friedman 2003). Other philosophers hold that autonomy possession requires substantive normative constraints of some kind or other–at the very least, it is argued that one must value autonomy in order to be truly autonomous (see Oshana 2003). As with the debate just mentioned, both sides of this debate can claim some intuitive support; this can be shown through the asking of opposing but seemingly equally compelling (apparently rhetorical) questions; namely, ‘Can’t one autonomously choose whatever one wants?’, and, ‘How can we call someone autonomous who doesn’t value or seek autonomous living?’ One possible solution to this debate is to say that while almost any individual choice can be autonomous, persons cannot live autonomous lives as a whole without some commitment to the value of autonomy.

Unlike moral and existentialist autonomy, personal autonomy is possessed in degrees, depending on the presence and strength of the constellation of internal capacities and external enabling conditions that make it possible. While not all persons possess personal autonomy, it is commonly claimed that virtually everyone–with the exception of the irredeemably pathological and the handicapped–possesses the capacity for personal autonomy. In addition, the links between personal autonomy possession and moral agency are usually said to be thin at best. Even those who hold that personal autonomy possession requires substantive normative commitments of some kind (such as, for example, a commitment to the value of autonomy itself), they usually hold that it is quite possible to be an autonomous villain. Some philosophers have argued that personal autonomy possession requires the presence of normative competency conditions that effectively provide agents with the capacity to distinguish right from wrong (see Wolf 1990), but this strong account is in general disfavor, and even if the account is correct, few would argue that this means that personally autonomous agents must also always act morally. In the face of this, one may wonder why autonomy-based claims are said to generate demands of respect upon others. This question will be dealt with in more detail in section 4 below.

Lastly, a word should be given on the relation between personal autonomy and freedom (or liberty, which is here taken to be synonymous with freedom). Although it is not uncommon to find the terms ‘(personal) autonomy’ and ‘freedom’ used essentially synonymously, there are some important differences between them.

More often than not, to claim that a person is free is to claim that she is negatively free in the sense that she is not constrained by internal or external forces that hinder making a choice and executing it in action. There is a clear distinction between autonomy and negative freedom, however, given that autonomy refers to the presence of a capacity for effective authentic living, and negative freedom refers to a lack of constraints on action.  It is entirely possible for a person to be free in this negative sense but nonautonomous, or–on accounts that do not require the presence of external enabling conditions for autonomy to be present–for a person to be autonomous but not (negatively) free.

Some writers also speak of positive freedom, and here the connections with autonomy become much deeper. Speaking very generally, to be free in this sense is to possess the abilities, capacities, knowledge, entitlements or skills necessary for the achievement of a given end. For example, I am only (positively) free to win an Olympic gold medal in archery if I am extremely skilled in the sport. Here it should be clear that one can be positively free in many ways and yet not be autonomous. Some philosophers, however, following Isaiah Berlin (Berlin 1948), have described positive freedom in such a way that it becomes basically synonymous with personal autonomy. Like autonomy, the conception of freedom that is operative in a given discussion can vary considerably; but more often than not personal autonomy is distinguished from freedom by the necessary presence, in the former, of a connection to the authenticity of the agent’s self-conception and life-plan–a connection that is usually not found in conceptions of freedom.

d. Autonomy as a Right

Lastly, autonomy is sometimes spoken of in a manner that is more directly normative than descriptive. In political philosophy and bioethics especially, it is common to find references to persons as autonomous, where the autonomy referred to is understood principally as a right to self-determination. In these contexts, to say that a person is autonomous is largely to say that she has a right to determine her life without interference from social or political authorities or forms of paternalism. Importantly, this right to self-directed living is often said to be possessed by persons by virtue either of their potential for autonomous living or of their inherent dignity as persons, but not by virtue of the presence of a developed and active capacity for autonomy (see Hill 1989). Some have argued that political rights (Ingram 1994) and even human rights generally (Richards 1989) are fundamentally based upon respect for the entitlements that attend possessing the capacity for autonomy.

3. The Normative Roles of Autonomy

Although disagreements concerning the nature of autonomy are rife, almost no one disagrees that autonomy has normative significance of some kind; and this agreement is found both in relation to the claim that autonomy is normatively significant for the autonomous agent and to the claim that autonomy is normatively significant for the addressees of autonomy-based demands. Following from this, autonomy plays an important normative role in a variety of philosophical areas.

a. Autonomy in Ethical Theory

Autonomy is referenced or invoked in a number of key ways in ethical theory:

(i) Autonomy serves as a ground for the claims that persons have dignity and inherently deserve basic moral respect

(ii) Autonomy is said to have a value that grounds the claim that persons deserve to be told the truth

(iii) Autonomy is referenced as a fundamental principle of ethics in Kantian deontology

(iv) Autonomy is commonly viewed as a key component of human well-being (and is therefore significant for utilitarianism)

(v) Autonomy is defended as an important virtue

(vi) Autonomy is said to be necessary for moral responsibility

(vii) Autonomy is said to have a value that grounds the claim that autonomy-based demands are worthy of special respect

(i) Ever since Kant, autonomy (or the capacity for autonomy) has been referenced by some philosophers as that property of human beings by virtue of which they possess inherent dignity and therefore inherently deserve to be treated with basic moral respect.  Kant’s justification for the claim that autonomy grounds the inherent dignity of persons was based on the view that it is by virtue of our autonomy that we are ends-in-ourselves.  Beings that lack autonomy are, precisely because of this lack, essentially at the mercy of the determinism that characterizes the phenomenal realm: they are controlled by forces that have nothing to do with their own will. Beings that possess autonomy on the other hand, are, precisely because of this possession, free from this determination; they have the capacity for freedom through the active exercise of their autonomous wills, which allows for the legislation of universal law. Autonomous agents are not passive players in life; they are active agents, determining themselves by their own will, the authors of the laws that they follow (see Guyer 2003). As such, they are not passive means towards nature’s determined ends, but are ends-in-themselves, by virtue of which they possess inherent dignity and deserve basic moral respect. Many have followed Kant in referencing autonomy as the ground of human dignity and as the basis of the basic moral respect owed to persons, although not all have followed Kant in the details of his account (for a recent account that moves away from Kant’s conception of noumenal freedom, see Korsgaard 1996). The most common objection leveled against this account is that it runs into problems involving exclusion. Most would argue that the mentally handicapped, for example, are owed basic moral respect, even if they do not possess (even the capacity for) autonomy. And if human dignity is indexed to the presence of autonomy, it is argued, this would entail, counter-intuitively, that those who are more autonomous have more dignity, and are more worthy of respect. It may also be argued that the capacity for autonomy is a poor ground for human dignity (and respect for persons) for other reasons–for example, because autonomy has no essential connection to morality, or because better grounds are available, or because the very project of grounding human dignity on a property of some kind is ill-conceived. Despite these worries, however, appeals to autonomy as a basis for human dignity and basic moral respect remain quite popular.

(ii) Some philosophers have argued that a proper appreciation for others as autonomous (or as possessing the capacity for autonomy) requires that one not seek to deceive them.  Respect for autonomy is thus said to have an important relation to truthfulness. In Thomas Hill’s words, “Lies often reflect inadequate respect for the autonomy of the person who is deceived.” (Hill 1991) We saw above that autonomy’s value has been used to ground the basic moral respect owed to persons; and the present injunction against deception may be viewed as a specific form that autonomy-based respect for persons may take. It is easy to see why a connection between respect for autonomy and truthfulness (or what comes to the same thing–an injunction against deception) has been attractive to some philosophers, especially those in the Kantian tradition. When we deceive others for our own purposes, we bypass their reflective abilities and make them instruments in the achievement of our own ends, and in doing this we fail to treat them as persons capable and deserving of self-determination. Proper respect for persons as autonomous thus requires a commitment to truthfulness. It has been argued, however, that one may respect and value the autonomy of another while deceiving them at the same time (Buss 2005). One may, for example, use forms of deception so that another’s capacity for autonomy may flourish. The basic idea here is that one may still reason for oneself despite being deliberately influenced by the deceptive behavior of others. As Sarah Buss writes, “To put it somewhat crudely, whether an instance of practical reasoning is self-determined is a matter of whether it is really the agent herself who is doing the reasoning. And this would seem to depend on whether she determines her response to the considerations that figure in her reasoning–not on how the considerations to which she responds relate to reality, nor on how she came to be aware of these considerations.” It may be argued, however, that the conception of autonomy underlying this claim is too thin to be acceptable, and that a better conception would contain the resources necessary to judge self-determining reasoning influenced by the deliberate deception of another as nonautonomous. In this vein, some have argued that a person is autonomous in relation to a given desire or choice only if that person would not feel alienated from the causal process that gave rise to that desire or choice (Christman 2007). On the assumption that persons would feel alienated from deceptive desire- or choice-forming processes, the associated desires or choices would not count as autonomous. In response to this, however, it may be argued that autonomous agents may not feel alienated from all (or many) deceptive forms of influence upon the formation of their desires and choices, depending on the circumstances (Buss 2005). If this were the case, then a commitment to the value of autonomy may not be inconsistent with certain forms of deception or manipulation. Yet, given the traditional opposition between autonomous self-determination and agential determination rooted in deceit and manipulation, it is to be expected that resistance to the notion that they are not incompatible will continue.

(iii) Autonomy plays a key role in Kant’s deontological ethics. We have already seen this in the way in which Kant grounds human dignity in autonomy. But autonomy plays a further (and closely related) normative role for Kant. It is often said that Kant held that the Categorical Imperative can be expressed in three closely related formulas: the Formula of Universal Law, the Formula of Humanity, and the Formula of the Kingdom of Ends. It has also been claimed, however, that Kant defended a fourth formula, which may be called the Formula of Autonomy. Although Kant did not state this formula explicitly, it has been argued that it can be plausibly derived from his description of the Categorical Imperative as “the idea of the will of every rational being as a will that legislates universal law.” The corresponding Formula of Autonomy could then be expressed as an imperative in this way: act so that the maxims you will could be the legislation of universal law. According to this formula, we should act according to principles that express the autonomy of the will. This formulation is important, firstly because it suggests that Kant conceived autonomy as a normative principle (and not merely as a condition of the will that makes morality possible), and secondly because it further reinforces Kant’s claim that humans, as autonomous law-givers, are the source of the universal law that guarantees their freedom and hence marks them out as possessing inherent dignity (see Reath 2006).

(iv) Autonomy is commonly held to be a core component of well-being. This view goes back at least to Mill’s On Liberty, and has been accepted by many contemporary philosophers as well (see for example Griffin 1986 and Sumner 1996). In this connection, some argue that autonomy is an intrinsic part of well-being, and others argue that being autonomous reliably leads to well-being (and hence has instrumental prudential value).  Although thus far, the normative importance of autonomy has been described as being associated primarily with deontology, the claim that autonomy is a core component of well-being shows that it can play a key role in consequentialist moral theories as well. Indeed, as will be discussed in greater detail below (section 4), although most defenses of the principle of respect for autonomy are deontological in nature, it is also possible to defend the principle on consequentialist grounds. From this point of view, it can be argued that autonomy deserves respect because respecting autonomy is reliably conducive to well-being.

(v) Autonomy has been claimed to be an important virtue to possess. It is not difficult to see why this is the case. The autonomous person is a person possessing a constellation of widely desirable qualities such as self-control, self-knowledge, rationality and reflective maturity. To be autonomous is to be self-governing; to be free from domination by foreign influences over one’s character and values; to ‘be one’s own person’. Following from this, it is claimed by some that autonomy is a great virtue to possess - one which constitutes an important part of human flourishing. It may be objected, however, that an excessive concern with autonomy can be at odds with virtue, especially if robust autonomy entails an inability to exhibit loyalty or fidelity to projects, other persons or communities. Recent work on personal autonomy, however, has tended to support the notion that autonomy possession is not incompatible with these and similar forms of attachment (Friedman 2003).

(vi) Autonomy has been seen by some thinkers as having implications for a correct account of moral responsibility. Some accounts hold that autonomy is a necessary condition for moral responsibility. The basic defense of this claim is that it makes little sense to say that someone is morally responsible for her actions if she is not the author of those actions; and since one is the author of one’s actions only if one is autonomous, autonomy possession is necessary for moral responsibility. According to this account, the class of actions that are autonomous and the class of actions for which we are morally responsible are identical, or at least almost so (see Fischer and Ravizza 1998). Other accounts hold that although persons are certainly morally responsible for their autonomous actions, they are also morally responsible for a wider range of actions as well. An account of this sort is often made by those who hold a more demanding conception of autonomy; and defenders of this account argue that we still want to hold persons morally responsible for the many actions that do not satisfy robust autonomy conditions on the one hand, but are not constituted of sheer heteronomy (brainwashing, psychosis, coercion, and so forth) on the other (see Arpaly 2005).

(vi) Many thinkers believe that autonomous claims or demands are worthy of special normative uptake–special respect–by virtue of the fact that they are autonomous. It is important to see how this claim is different from the first point given above (viz., that autonomy is said to ground basic moral respect for persons). The former claim is that the fact that persons are autonomous (or have the capacity for autonomy) is what grounds their special dignity, by virtue of which they are owed basic moral respect. Now, it is possible to owe someone basic moral respect, but not to owe special respect to a subset of their choices. Imagine that someone is brainwashed, for example. Many would argue that although we owe that person basic moral respect (for example, we are obligated, say, not to harm them or to lie to them), we do not owe special respect to that person’s demands (say, to promote or not interfere with those demands). The current claim holds, however, that the fact that a person’s choices are autonomous generates special demands of respect for those choices over and above the basic respect owed to the chooser (whether this be conceived as being by virtue of their capacity for autonomy or not). This principle–that autonomous choice deserves special respect–may be justified in either a deontological or consequentialist manner. Because of the considerable importance of this principle, however, it deserves a more detailed discussion, which is provided in section 4 below.

b. Autonomy in Applied Ethics

The principle of respect for autonomy has had a considerable influence on applied ethics largely because of its versatility: it can be invoked in any applied ethics debate that bears (even remotely) on morally significant situations that involve the demands of self-determination, free choice, authenticity or independence. Seven of the most important of these debates–certainly not an exhaustive list–will be briefly canvassed below:

(i) Autonomy and informed consent

(ii) Autonomy and abortion

(iii) Autonomy and end-of-life decisions

(iv) Autonomy and same-sex marriage

(v) Autonomy and just war theory

(vi) Autonomy and advertising

(vii) Autonomy and environmental ethics

(i) Respect for autonomy has had a major influence on debates in medical ethics, especially those concerning the constraints that should be in place within the physician-patient relationship. Perhaps the most important such constraint is that of informed consent. According to this principle, a patient should not receive medical treatment of any sort unless she is well-informed enough as to the treatment’s nature and effects to be able to make an informed decision about it. The patient must agree to the treatment on the basis of this information. Many have argued that the requirement of informed consent is necessitated as part and parcel of a more basic imperative to respect patient autonomy (Dworkin 2006). Few argue that respecting patient autonomy has no weight at all; more commonly, objectors argue that there are cases in which overriding patient autonomy is sometimes justified by the good consequences that will likely result from doing so.

(ii) Autonomy is also referenced as an important value to be taken into consideration in the abortion debate, although it is referenced in different ways. On the one hand, it is argued that some abortions are justified as an expression of a woman’s reproductive autonomy (see Overall 1990 and Fischer 2003). On the other hand, it could be argued that abortion is morally unacceptable, among other reasons, because it fails to respect the potential future autonomy of the aborted (for a related argument, see Marquis 1989).  Assuming that both of these autonomy-based arguments have weight, adjudicating this dispute requires–among other things–establishing and defending the relative weights of actual and potential autonomy, both in relation to particular choices and in relation to lives as wholes.

(iii) Many argue that considerations of respect for autonomy are also decisive in the debates concerning the moral acceptability of euthanasia and suicide. Respect for autonomy can be viewed as a reason for accepting voluntary euthanasia. The basic argument here is one of consistency: if respect for others’ autonomy requires respecting others’ self-determining life-choices (at least when these are competently made), and if end-of-life decisions are placed within the ambit of life-choices, then end-of-life decisions made by competent, autonomous persons should be respected, even if these decisions involve voluntary euthanasia (for a related argument, see Brock 1993). Some have cast doubt, however, on whether a decision to die can be an autonomous decision at all, given the likely presence of psychological factors such as fear, hopelessness, and despair–factors which would undermine careful introspection and critical thought (Hartling 2006). Respect for autonomy can also be seen as a reason for respecting the decision to end one’s life, even when reasons of mercy are not in play–that is, in cases of suicide–at least where there is reason to hold that the agent is sufficiently competent and rational (Webber & Shulman 1987). Some argue, however, that autonomy-based defenses of voluntary euthanasia and suicide involve a contradiction insofar as they invoke the value of autonomy to justify an act that destroys autonomy (Safranak 1988 and Doerflinger 1989). If correct, these arguments do not show that voluntary euthanasia or suicide are unacceptable; they show rather that arguments to establish their acceptability cannot be based on respect for autonomy. It may be a cause of worry, however, that such arguments prove too much by rendering unacceptable autonomy-based respect for any decision that involves a subsequent lessening of free choice.

(iv) Autonomy also carries normative weight in a number of applied ethics debates relating to public policy. Respect for autonomy can be straightforwardly referenced, for example, as an argument in favor of the acceptability of same-sex marriage: respect for others’ autonomy entails respect for their autonomous decisions, and decisions regarding marriage–even same-sex marriage–fall within these parameters (when autonomous).  Objectors might argue, however, that homosexual marriage is immoral, and that the right to noninterference with autonomous choice does not exist where the object of the choice is immoral. Few would argue, for example, that there exists an obligation to respect someone’s autonomous decision to embezzle money, given that that act is immoral. The question then becomes whether same-sex marriage is morally acceptable.

(v) Respect for autonomy also plays a role in discussions of a just-war theory. Specifically, it has been referenced as the key principle determining the proper constraints and limitations that should be in place if we wish our prosecution of war to be just. It has been argued, for example–and in partial conjunction with what has been said above–that possession of autonomy (or the existence of a capacity for it) is the ground of human dignity, and hence the actions which appreciate that dignity must center on respect for autonomy. In relation to war, this suggests that while war may sometimes be morally permissible (in cases of self-defense, for example), wartime actions cannot involve violations of others’ autonomy, especially that of noncombatants (for an extended discussion, see Zupan 2004).

(vi) In business ethics, respect for autonomy has been identified as a key reason why persuasive advertising practices are morally unacceptable (Crisp 1987). The arguments given in support of this claim largely follow those mentioned above in relation to truthfulness–viz. that respect for others’ autonomy is incompatible with deception or manipulation–combined with the claim that persuasive advertising practices constitute deception or manipulation. In this vein it has also been argued that persuasive advertising undermines consumer autonomy by creating foreign desires and wants and by producing compulsive behavior in consumers. Some have argued, however, that persuasive advertising practices do not threaten consumers’ autonomy, at least not necessarily or intrinsically (Arrington 1982). From this point of view, although such deception may occur, this is the exception; usually it provides consumers with the information necessary for making informed decisions. It has also been argued that, even if persuasive advertising thwarts autonomy, it is still in consumers’ interests to be exposed to it, given that companies would likely only go to such trouble for products that will be market-winners, and hence that consumers would have desired and bought those products anyway, even after careful consideration (Nelson 1978). One obvious problem with this argument is that it assumes that heavy persuasive marketing is a sign of product quality, which is certainly debatable; but even if that premise is granted, it may still be argued that rhetorical device laden advertising, by attempting to bypass consumers’ critical thinking abilities, violates their autonomy.

(vii) Respect for autonomy has even been referenced in relation to issues in environmental ethics. Eric Katz has argued, for example, that nature as a whole constitutes an ‘autonomous subject’, which therefore deserves moral respect and should not be treated as a mere means to the satisfaction of human ends (Katz 1997). Critics of this view may wonder whether the notion of an autonomous subject operative here has been stretched to breaking point, or rendered hollow. If correct, this criticism does not, of course, entail that prohibitions against using nature as a mere means to human ends cannot be provided; it simply means that an acceptable defense cannot be based on autonomy-related considerations.

It should be clear from the breadth and diversity of the employment of the principle of respect for autonomy that it is both, extremely versatile and a mainstay of applied ethics debates. The brief sketches given above concern some of the more prominent autonomy-related discussions in applied ethics, but other debates in applied ethics–relating, for example, to injunctions against discrimination (Gardner 1992 and Doyle 2007) or against domestic abuse (Friedman 2003), to name a couple–have been approached and adjudicated in reference to the importance of respecting autonomy as well.

More often than not, however, those who reference the principle of respect for autonomy in applied ethics either take its normative force for granted, or only devote passing attention to the question of its justification. Yet, given that the principle is neither self-evident nor immune to challenge, it is very important that those who reference the principle be able to provide a robust justification of its normative weight. Because of its fundamentality, this issue will be considered separately and in more detail in section 4 below.

c. Autonomy in Political Philosophy

Autonomy is considered normatively significant for issues in political philosophy, primarily in relation to discussions of social justice and rights. It is particularly important for political liberalism (see, for example, Christman and Anderson 2005); and some have argued that autonomy is the core value of liberalism (see White 1991 and Dagger 2005).  Four of the most important issues in political philosophy that invoke the normative significance of autonomy include:

(i) The establishment and validation of just social and political principles

(ii) The legitimation of political power

(iii) The justification of political rights (both specific and general)

(iv) The acceptability of political paternalism

(i) A conception of the autonomous individual provides the perspective from which social and political principles are formulated, and validated as just, in several contractarian political theories. A classic example is provided in Rawls’ A Theory of Justice (1971).  According to Rawls, principles of social justice are best conceived and validated based on what would be acceptable to (representatives of) members of society gathering together in an ‘original position’ behind a ‘veil of ignorance’. Rawls argued that the conditions that constrain this process will ensure that those taking part in it are acting autonomously (that is, according to Rawls, as free and rational). Of key importance is the veil of ignorance because, by preventing any detailed knowledge of one’s condition or place in society, it “deprives the persons in the original position of the knowledge that would enable them to choose heteronomous principles”. Rawls concludes: “[W]e can say that by acting from these principles persons are acting autonomously: they are acting from principles that they would acknowledge under conditions that best express their nature as free and equal rational beings.” Given these key constraints in the contracting process, it  results, according to Rawls, in valid principles of social justice. Here it can be seen that autonomy has double (and mutually supporting) normative significance: it characterizes members of society in an idealized way in order to form the normatively privileged perspective from which to establish principles of social justice; and it provides the standard that validates those principles as just (viz., by being accepted by autonomous agents). One can see the influence of Kant’s conception of autonomy and its normative significance in this doctrine. Roughly put, Kant held that moral principles are those that would be accepted by persons within an idealized constraint–viz., insofar as they are autonomous. Similarly, Rawls argued that the principles of social justice are those that would be accepted by persons within an idealized constraint–viz., insofar as they are conceived as autonomous (free and rational) agents behind a veil of ignorance in the original position. Rawls explicitly acknowledged his indebtedness to Kant in this regard.

(ii) In relation, a cornerstone of political liberalism is the view that political power is legitimized by its free acceptance by a state’s subjects who are conceived (at least minimally) as autonomous persons. John Locke is recognized as one of the key progenitors of this view of the legitimation of political power. In Two Treatises on Government (1689), he wrote: “Men being, as has been said, by nature all free, equal, and independent, no one can be put out of his estate, and subjected to the political power of another, without his own consent, which is done by agreeing with other men to join and unite into a community for their comfortable, safe, and peaceable living one amongst another…” That which secures the legitimacy of government on such a view is precisely the agreement to do so amongst those who are not only naturally equal in standing, but also free and independent–that is, self-directing. The tradition of placing crucial normative weight on the autonomy of the contracting parties has continued to the present.  Referring to liberalism in political philosophy in general, John Christman has written (2005), “Liberal legitimacy…assumes that autonomous citizens can endorse the principles that shape the institutions of political power….In this way, political power is an outgrowth of autonomous personhood and choice.” As before, autonomy is fulfilling two (mutually supporting) roles: it is being used to delimit the normatively privileged perspective from which judgment is authoritative regarding political legitimacy, and it is informing (at least partly) the standard in relation to which that judgment (viz., the acceptance of a political power) is made.

(iii) Autonomy is referenced as a core ground in the justification of political rights in a broadly liberal political framework. It is argued, for example, that a theory of autonomy has to be presupposed to achieve agreement with a theory of rights that in principle is acceptable to all. It is also argued that autonomy is absolutely central in views of rights that enshrine the idea that people have the freedom equally to conceive and enjoy widely different forms of meaningful life. Attracta Ingram (Ingram 1994) provides a clear articulation of the view that autonomy deserves a central place in the defense of a scheme of political rights: “I think that the most compelling answer is that people’s most vital human interest is in living meaningful lives. This interest cannot be secured while they are at risk of slavery, social subordination, repression, persecution, and grinding poverty - conditions that history shows to be the lot of many in societies which do not recognize the value of individual freedom. So it is rational for people to want to develop the mental capacities and social environment necessary to living independent lives. Since what is at stake is the proper distribution of human freedom, we have here matters of justice and rights; the province of political morality.” (112-3) Autonomy is thus said by some to be a–or the–core unifying value in a conception of rights that is liberal (and hence pluralistic) in tenor (see also Richards 1989). In addition, the value of autonomy is referenced to justify particular rights such as the right to free speech (Brison 2000) or the right to privacy (Kupfer 1987).

(iv) Autonomy is referenced by many as the core value that militates against the acceptability of political (and informal) paternalism. According to a widely-accepted conception, an act is paternalistic if it involves direct interference with another’s actions and will for the purpose of advancing (what the interferer takes to be) that person’s own good. Paternalism bypasses the agent’s capacity to be self-directing and ignores the agent’s wishes regarding the way she would like to live her own life; and it is these factors that constitute a violation of the autonomy of the one suffering paternalistic influence. It is commonly held that possession of the capacity for autonomy gives the agent a right and an authority–at least in relation to minimally voluntary, self-regarding choices (all else being equal)–to be self-determining without interference (for a detailed account of paternalism and the defense of the claims of autonomy, see VanDeVeer 1986; see also Mill’s classic argument against paternalism in On Liberty). Supporters of paternalistic doctrines tend to argue that paternalism is justified based either on the highly beneficial consequences of such interference, or on the ground that a policy of paternalism could be hypothetically accepted by autonomous agents when the possible related consequences are severe enough (on the latter see Rawls 1999). It has also been argued that a certain degree of paternalism is unavoidable, but that such paternalism should be constrained by the goal of leading persons to welfare-promoting choices while not threatening freedom of choice (Sunstein and Thaler 2003).

It is worth mentioning in passing that J.S. Mill, who is often referenced as a champion of individual liberty and a firm critic of paternalistic policy, endorsed a strong version of paternalism, but only in relation to “those backward states of society in which the race itself may be considered as in its nonage.”  In relation to these, Mill (1971) claimed that “Despotism is a legitimate mode of government in dealing with barbarians, provided the end be their improvement and the means justified by actually effecting that end.”  Although these claims of Mill’s would find few supporters today, it is worth adding that the standard that Mill employed to ground the distinction between unjustified and justified paternalism was the presence of a kind of maturity of thought and judgment that is not greatly dissimilar to autonomy: “[A]s soon as mankind have attained the capacity of being guided to their own improvement by conviction or persuasion…compulsion, either in the direct form or in that of pains and penalties for noncompliance, is no longer admissible as a means to their own good, and justifiable only for the security of others.”

d. Autonomy in Philosophy of Education

Several philosophers have argued that autonomy development is the most important goal (or at least one of the most important goals) of a liberal education. Reasoning in support of this claim usually takes two forms. Firstly, some argue that autonomy should be the primary goal of liberal education because autonomy enhancement is the most important goal of the liberal state, and hence an education in such a state should be an education for autonomy (see White 1991, and compare with Raz 1986, ch. 14). Secondly, some argue that autonomy should be the goal of liberal education because it should be a key goal of any form of education, largely because an education for autonomy is crucial for human well-being across the board.

The latter position has been challenged by communitarians, however, who argue that there is no justification for the claim that autonomy is universally valuable, and who see autonomy as at best a parochial (Western) value (see MacIntyre 1981, White 1991, and Raz 1986). The communitarian argument has been challenged in various ways. It has been directly counter-argued, for example, that autonomy is universally intrinsic to well-being (see Norman 1994 and Ishtiyaque & Cuypers 2008). In addition, the epistemic benefits of autonomy development for forming rational judgments about one’s life have been cited as reason for allowing the state to mandate education for autonomy, even over the protests of more traditionally-minded parents (MacMullen 2007). Although communitarians continue to be suspicious of the claim that autonomy should be a goal of all education, it is widely agreed that education for autonomy is central to an education in a liberal society.

4. Warrant for the Principle of Respect for Autonomous Choice

As mentioned above (in section 3a), the idea that autonomy gives rise to demands of respect can take two forms. On the one hand, it is argued that the possession of autonomy or the capacity for it grounds human dignity and the basic moral respect for persons that attends that dignity. On the other hand, it is argued that the fact that a choice or demand is autonomous is reason to give special or added normative uptake to that choice or demand. For clarity, one might refer to the former as the principle of respect for autonomy and the latter as the principle of respect for autonomous choice. The principle of respect for autonomy has already been examined in connection with Kant’s moral philosophy, and it was shown that although this principle has been popular, it is also quite controversial, largely because of problems involving exclusion. The principle of respect for autonomous choice will be examined in the present section. As shown above, this principle plays a key role in a variety of normative debates, especially debates in applied ethics. As has been mentioned, however, the principle is often either invoked without supporting argument or is given thin justification at best. The principle is therefore worthy of further discussion, especially with regard to its normative warrant. What is the warrant for the claim that autonomous choices give rise to special demands of respect? Two views have emerged on this question. Unsurprisingly, these views can be delineated along deontological and consequentialist lines.

Firstly, many philosophers following Kant (often only roughly), contend that autonomous choices deserve special respect because persons, as capable of self-determination, are entitled, all else being equal, to be self-determining without interference. This may be termed the authority view of the justification for the principle of respect for autonomous choice. The authority view is most often allied to the view that respect for autonomy functions primarily as a side-constraint which forbids paternalistically-motivated interference in the self-regarding, minimally voluntary choices of others, even if such interference would be prudentially best for the choosing persons.

Secondly, some philosophers following Mill, contend that autonomous choices deserve special respect because a policy of such respect conduces to desirable prudential consequences, either for the choosing agent, or aggregately. On this view, autonomous choices are not to be respected merely because they are autonomous, or because those making them have a capacity for self-determination, but rather because doing so will lead to the most beneficial prudential results. This more consequentialist view of the normative warrant for the principle of respect for autonomous choice may be termed the benefit view.

Based on the literature, it is quite clear that the authority view is the dominant view in the field, and has been for some time. Many philosophers hold that persons have a right to have their self-determining choices respected even in cases where there is good reason to think that the fulfillment of their autonomous choices would lead to bad prudential results (see Wellman 2003 and Darwall 2006). Against this it may be argued that where the prudential results of respecting a person’s autonomous choice are disastrous enough, interference may be justified, thus opening the door to the salience of consequentialist considerations bearing upon the principle (see Young 1982 and Wellman 2003). It has also been argued that the relation between the fulfillment of at least minimally robust autonomous choice and the resulting expression of authentic selfhood (conceived as highly prudentially significant) suggests that the benefit view deserves to be given closer attention (Piper 2009). Given the great popularity and wide employment of the principle of respect for autonomous choice, it is safe to say that the question of its normative warrant deserves far greater attention than it has thus far received.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Anderson, Joel and Axel Honneth. “Autonomy, Vulnerability, Recognition, and Justice.”  In Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism: New Essays, eds. John Christman and Joel Anderson, 127-149. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Arpaly, Nomy. “Responsibility, Applied Ethics, and Complex Autonomy Theories.” In Personal Autonomy: New Essays in Personal Autonomy and Its Role in Contemporary Moral Philosophy, ed. James Stacey Taylor, 162-180. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Arrington, Robert L. “Advertising and Behavior Control.” Journal of Business Ethics 1, no. 1 (Feb. 1982): 3-12.
  • Berlin, Isaiah. Two Concepts of Liberty. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1958.
  • Berofsky, Bernard. Liberation from Self: A Theory of Personal Autonomy. Cambridge; Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Brison, Susan J. “Relational Autonomy and the Freedom of Expression.”  In Relational Autonomy: Feminist Perspectives on Autonomy, Agency, and the Social Self, eds. Catriona Mackenzie and Natalie Stoljar, 280-299. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Brock, D. “Voluntary Active Euthanasia.” The Hastings Center Report 22, no. 2 (1993): 10-22.
  • Buss, Sarah. “Valuing Autonomy and Respecting Persons: Manipulation, Seduction, and the Basis of Moral Constraints.” Ethics 115, no. 2 (Jan 2005): 195-235.
  • Christman, John and Joel Anderson, eds. Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism: New Essays. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Christman, John. “Autonomy, History, and the Subject of Justice.” Social Theory and Practice 33, no. 1 (January 2007): 1-26.
  • Christman, J. “Autonomy, Self-Knowledge, and Liberal Legitimacy.” In Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism: New Essays, eds. John Christman and Joel Anderson, 330-357. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Cooper, John. “Stoic Autonomy.” In Autonomy, eds. Ellen Frankel Paul, Fred Miller, and Jeffrey Paul: 1-29. Cambridge: University of Cambridge Press, 2003.
  • Crisp, Roger. “Persuasive Advertising, Autonomy, and the Creation of Desire.” Journal of Business Ethics 6, no. 5 (July 1987): 413-418.
  • Dagger, Richard. “Autonomy, Domination, and the Republican Challenge to Liberalism.”  In Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism: New Essays, eds. John Christman and Joel Anderson, 177-203. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Darwall, Stephen. “The Value of Autonomy and Autonomy of the Will.” Ethics 116, no. 2 (January 2006): 263-284.
  • Doerflinger, Richard. “Assisted Suicide: Pro-Choice or Anti-Life?” The Hastings Center Report 19, no. 1 (Jan-Feb 1989): 16-19.
  • Doyle, Oran. “Direct Discrimination, Indirect Discrimination, and Autonomy.” Oxford Journal of Legal Studies 27, no. 3 (2007): 537-553.
  • Dworkin, Gerald. The Theory and Practice of Autonomy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
  • Dworkin, Gerald. “Autonomy and Informed Consent.” In Ethical Health Care, eds. Patrician Illingworth and Wendy Parmet, 79-91. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Pearson Prentice-Hall, 2006.
  • Fischer, John Martin. “Abortion, Autonomy, and Control Over One’s Body.” Social Philosophy and Policy 20, no. 2 (2003): 286-306.
  • Fischer, John Martin and Mark Ravizza. Responsibility and Control: A Theory of Moral Responsibility. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Frankfurt, Harry. “Freedom of the Will and the Concept of a Person.” In The Importance of What We Care About by Harry Frankfurt, 11-25. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
  • Frankfurt, Harry. Necessity, Volition, and Love. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Friedman, Marilyn. Autonomy, Gender, Politics. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003.
  • Gardner, John. “Private Activities and Personal Autonomy: At the Margins of Anti-discrimination Law.” In Discrimination: The Limits of the Law, eds. Bob Hepple and Erika Szyszczak, 148-171. London: Mansell, 1992.
  • Griffin, James. Well-Being: Its Meaning, Measurement, and Moral Importance. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1986.
  • Guyer, Paul. “Kant on the Theory and Practice of Autonomy.” In Autonomy, eds. Ellen Frankel Paul, Fred Miller, and Jeffrey Paul: 70-98. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • Hartling, O.J.  “Euthanasia–the Illusion of Autonomy.” Medicine and Law 25, no. 1 (2006): 189-99.
  • Hill, Thomas. “The Kantian Conception of Autonomy.” In The Inner Citadel: Essays on Individual Autonomy, ed. John Christman, 91-105. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989.
  • Hill, Thomas. “Autonomy and Benevolent Lies.” In Autonomy and Self-Respect by Thomas Hill, 25-42. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • Ingram, Attracta. A Political Theory of Rights. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1994.
  • Ishtiyaque, Haji and Stefaan Cuypers. “Authenticity-Sensitive Preferentism and Educating for Well-Being and Autonomy.” Journal of Philosophy of Education 42, no. 1 (February 2008): 85-106.
  • Kant, Immanuel, trans. Mary Gregor. Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Katz, Eric. Nature As Subject. New York: Rowman & Littlefield, 1997.
  • Korsgaard, Christine. Creating the Kingdom of Ends. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Kupfer, Joseph. “Privacy, Autonomy, and Self-Concept.” American Philosophical Quarterly 24, no. 1 (January 1987): 81-9.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. After Virtue: A Study in Moral Theory. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1981.
  • Mackenzie, Catriona and Natalie Stoljar, eds. Relational Autonomy: Feminist Perspectives on Autonomy, Agency, and the Social Self. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • MacMullen, Ian. Faith in Schools? Autonomy, Citizenship and Religious Education in the Liberal State. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 2007.
  • Marquis, Don. “Why Abortion is Immoral.” Journal of Philosophy 86 (April 1989): 183-202.
  • Mele, Alfred. Autonomous Agents: From Self-Control to Autonomy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995.
  • Meyers, Diana. Self, Society, and Personal Choice. New York: Columbia University Press, 1989.
  • Mill, John Stuart. On Liberty. Edited by Curran V. Shields. New Jersey: Prentice-Hall Inc., 1997.
  • Nelson, Philip. “Advertising and Ethics.” In Ethics, Free Enterprise, and Public Policy: Original Essays on Moral Issues in Business, eds. Robert T. De George and Joseph A. Pichler. New York: Oxford University Press, 1978.
  • Norman, Richard. “‘I Did It My Way’: Some Thoughts on Autonomy.” Journal of Philosophy of Education 28, no. 1 (1994): 25-34.
  • Oshana, Marina. “Personal Autonomy and Society.” Journal of Social Philosophy 29, no. 1 (Spring 1998): 81-102.
  • Oshana, Marina. “How Much Should We Value Autonomy?” In Autonomy, eds. Ellen Frankel Paul, Fred Miller, and Jeffrey Paul, 99-126. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • Overall, Christine. “Selective Termination of Pregnancy and Women’s Reproductive Autonomy.” The Hastings Center Report 20, no. 3 (May-June 1990): 6-11.
  • Piper, Mark. “On Respect for Personal Autonomy and the Value Instantiated in Autonomous Choice.” Southwest Philosophy Review 25, no. 1 (January 2009): 189-198.
  • Pohlmann, R. “Autonomie.” In Historisches Wörterbuch der Philosophie, ed. J. Ritter, 1: 701-719. Basel: Schwabe, 1971.
  • Rawls, John. A Theory of Justice, rev. ed. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1999.
  • Raz, Joseph. The Morality of Freedom. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1986.
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  • Richards, David A.J. “Rights and Autonomy.” In The Inner Citadel: essays on Individual Autonomy, ed. John Christman, 203-220. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989.
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  • Wellman, Christopher Heath. “The Paradox of Group Autonomy.” In Autonomy, eds. Ellen Frankel Paul, Fred Miller, and Jeffrey Paul, 265-285. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
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  • Young, Robert. “The Value of Autonomy.” The Philosophical Quarterly 32, no. 126 (January 1982): 35-44.
  • Zupan, Daniel S. War, Morality, and Autonomy: An Investigation in Just War Theory. Hampshire, England: Ashgate Publishing Ltd., 2004.

Author Information

Mark Piper
James Madison University
U. S. A.

The American Environmental Justice Movement

The origin of the American environmental justice movement can be traced back to the emergence of the American Civil Rights movement of the 1960s, and more specifically to the U.S. Civil Rights Act of 1964.  The movement reached a new level with the emergence of Robert Bullard’s work entitled Dumping in Dixie in the 1990’s, which constituted a clarion call for environmental justice. Although environmentalism and the environmental justice movement are related, there is a difference.  Environmentalism is concerned with humanity’s adverse impact upon the environment, but proponents are primarily concerned with the impact of an unhealthy environment thrust upon a collective body of life, entailing both human and non-human existence, including in some instances plant life.  The efforts of the environmental justice movement differ from those of the environmentalist movement in that, at the heart of environmental injustice, there are issues of racism and socio-economic injustice.  Although environmentalism focuses upon and acknowledges the negative impact of humanity’s actions upon the environment, the environmental justice movement builds upon the philosophy and work of environmentalism by stressing the manner in which adversely impacting the environment in turn adversely impacts the population of that environment.

Table of Contents

  1. The Definition of Environmental Justice
  2. History of the Environmental Justice Movement
  3. Environmental Racism and Environmental Justice
  4. Principles of the Environmental Justice Movement
  5. Causes of Environmental Injustice
  6. Major Events in the Environmental Justice Movement
  7. Environmental Justice Policy and Law
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Books
    2. Journals
    3. Governmental and Legal Publications

1. The Definition of Environmental Justice

Although the origin of the environmental justice movement is traced to the passing of the Civil Rights Act of 1964, Robert Bullard’s work entitled Dumping in Dixie published in the 1990’s is considered to be the first book addressing the reality of environmental injustice.  The work examines the widening economic, health and environmental disparities between racial groups and socioeconomic groups at the end of the twentieth and the beginning of the twenty-first centuries.  Bullard states that in writing the book he operated with the assumption that all Americans have a basic right to live, work, play, go to school and worship in a clean and healthy environment (DD, xii).  Bullard’s analysis in Dumping in Dixie “chronicles the emergence of the environmental justice movement in an effort to develop common strategies that are supportive of building sustainable African American communities and other people of color communities.”  (DD, xiii).

Bullard’s wife, a practicing attorney, suggested that he study the spatial location of all the municipal solid-waste disposal facilities in Houston, Texas. This was done as part of a class-action lawsuit filed by Bullard’s wife against the city of Houston, the State of Texas, and Browning Ferris Industries.  The lawsuit originated from a plan to site a municipal landfill in a suburban, middle-income neighborhood of single-family homeowners. The lawsuit became known as Bearn v. Southwestern Waste Management and was the first lawsuit in the United States charging environmental discrimination in waste facility location under the Civil Rights Act. The Northwood Manor neighborhood consisted of over 82 percent African American residents (DD, xii).

The emergence of the environmental justice movement is directly linked to the environmental movement.  Some contend that environmentalism and the environmental justice movement are so interrelated that the movement has essentially redefined the nature of environmentalism. According to Bullard, an environmental revolution is taking shape in the United States which “has touched communities of color from New York to California and from Florida to Alaska” and any location “where African Americans, Latinos, Asians, Pacific Islanders, and Native Americans live and comprise a major portion of the population” (CER, 7).  The influence of the environmental justice movement has broadened the spectrum of environmentalism to include what might be regarded as the trivialities of life, according to Bullard. This includes activities such as play and attending school. It also has implications for something as simple as where humans, animals and plants reside. Bullard points out that the environmental justice movement in the United States focuses upon a diversity of areas including wilderness and wildlife preservation, resource conservation, pollution abatement and population control (DD, 1). The environmental justice movement served to interrelate the physical, social, and cultural dimensions of human, non-human and plant existence under the rubric of environmentalism in general and environmental justice in particular.   (Bullard, 1999) The environmental justice movement has indirectly heightened concern not only for human existence, but also for animals and plant life.  The reality is that no single definition of environmental justice exists. However, a significant legal definition used by the Environmental Protection Agency describes environmental justice as:

[T]he fair treatment and meaningful involvement of all people regardless of race, ethnicity, income, national origin, or educational level with respect to the development, implementation and enforcement of environmental laws, regulations and policies. Fair treatment means that no population, due to policy or economic disempowerment, is forced to bear a disproportionate burden of the negative human health or environmental impacts of pollution or other environmental consequences resulting from industrial, municipal, and commercial operations or the execution of federal, state, local, and tribal programs and policies (EPA, 2).

The environmental justice movement is concerned with the pursuit of social justice and the preamble to the Principles of environmental justice adopted at the First National People of Color Environmental Leadership Summit in Washington D.C., 1991 reflects the primacy of this concern.  According to the environmental justice movement, all Americans, regardless of whether they are white or black, rich or poor, are entitled to equal protection under the law.  The  environmental justice advocates for quality education, employment, and housing, as well as the health of physical environments in which individuals, families and groups live (DD, 7).

While the environmental justice movement is rooted in significant philosophical/sociological underpinnings, the movement strives to be intensely practical. Few environmentalists realize the sociologic implications of what has been termed the “not-in-my-backyard” phenomenon which entails the recognition of the reality that hazardous waste, garbage dumps and polluting industries will inevitably be located in someone’s backyard.  The question then emerges as to whose and which backyards these toxic entities will be located? Bullard concluded based upon sociological analysis that these entities frequently end up in poor, powerless, black communities rather than affluent suburbs and he adds that this has been the case repeatedly (DD, 4).

It is important to note that the movement is critical of Western theories of jurisprudence and philosophy, which are founded upon Kantian, Cartesian and Lockean assumptions. For instance, Kantian jurisprudence is committed to the idea of the universality of rules in addressing a wide range of moral issues, whereas Cartesian dualism devalues the significance of physical existence and threats to that existence, and the philosophical conclusions of John Locke preserves individualism at the expense of the collective group. The environmental justice movement rejects each of these, concluding that no universal law or rule can be applied in a diversity of moral contexts, that the physical existence of a collective body is to be aggressively protected, and, finally, that no one individual or particular group is to be victimized for the benefit of another.  In short, such theories do not "embrace the whole community of life as the relevant moral community" (Rasmussen, 12).  Not only do these traditional philosophical underpinnings of the Western worldview fail to include members of the total human community, these approaches also fail to acknowledge the significance of life in the non-human sphere.

It is also important to note that environmental justice advocates reject the Rawlsian understanding of justice as "fairness".  In acknowledging the reality of social, economic and moral inequity, Rawls argued that these inequities must be based upon the condition of benefit to the least advantaged. In the philosophy of the environmental justice movement, however, to adopt Rawls’ definition of justice and to tolerate the existence of actual instances of inequities and injustice based upon benefit to the collective victims reflects a perpetuation of centuries of oppression, which have become part and parcel of inadequate and distorted forms of institutional decision-making (Deane Drummond, 10). Furthermore, for environmental justice proponents, "justice is justice as distribution, recognition, and participation, linked in ways that address the wellbeing of the whole community of life in a given locale" (Rasmussen, 17).

Part of the uniqueness of the environmental justice movement is the focus on injustice as a collective experience.  Consequently, those in the movement strive for the actual pursuit, promotion, and establishment of better living conditions in the midst of collective entities, both human and non-human.  As such, at its very core the environmental justice movement is transformational and strives to empower collective victims of environmental injustice with the capacity for self-provision, self-organization, and self-governance (Rasmussen, 17).

In addition and as previously indicated, there is an important distinction to be made between environmentalism and the environmental justice movement.  While environmentalism is concerned with environmental injustice and the pursuit of justice, it is primarily concerned with the abuse of the environment by a hierarchical model which places humanity at the top with the result being the abuse of nature.  On the other hand, environmental justice advocates are more concerned with what is termed "social ecology" or "human welfare ecology." Their primary concern is the impact of institutional systemic flaws which are the natural result of a progression of historical events resulting in decisions which establish unjust living conditions upon one group of people due to a lack of organization, power and prominence. At the risk of oversimplification, whereas environmentalism is concerned with humanity’s adverse impact upon the environment, environmental justice proponents are primarily concerned with the impact of an unhealthy environment thrust upon a collective body of life, both human and non-human, including in some instances plant life. The efforts of the environmental justice movement go beyond those of the environmentalism movement.

Environmental justice advocates contend that instances of environmental injustice are not simply arbitrary realities which occur in varying contexts.  Rather, instances of environmental injustice are the outcome of an institutional oppression and isolation which have set up an inevitable framework of the powerful oppressing the powerless. The victims, through a significant occurrence of historical and social realities, have been cut off from the power required even to challenge the causes of environmental injustice.  In a very real sense, the environmental justice movement represents another dimension of social liberation, which attempts to protect victims from institutional and systemic oppression. However, the task of the environmental justice movement should not be understood only in terms of the negative.  The central and positive question of the environmental justice movement is, "What constitutes healthy, livable, sustainable, and viable communities in the place we live, work, and play as the outcome of interrelated natural, built, social, and cultural/spiritual environments?" (Lee, 141-44).

The environmental justice movement also understands environmental injustice as part of a history of oppression and contends that profound historical realities predating the contemporary context of human existence in the Western world lie at the root of environmental injustice.  Advocates of environmental justice contend that the lack of power on the part of the victims of environmental injustice have a direct relationship of continuity with events emerging from the recent civil rights issues, to the civil war, and even trace the root cause of the systemic lack of power by certain groups to the impact of European-based realities which continue to shape the modern context of environmental injustice.  Environmental justice proponents focus upon what is termed "the four interlocking C's" which have led to the exploitation of particular groups of people.  These "C's" are conquest, colonization, commerce, and Christian implantation.

The call for environmental justice focuses on both environmental and ecological economics, which are reflected respectively in the work of environmental economics advocates such as Herman Daly, John Kenneth Galbraith and Nicholas Georgescu-Roegen, and ecological economics advocates such as Rebecca Pates and John Hagan.  While the environmental justice movement is primarily concerned with issues related to the United States, any consideration of the movement must acknowledge the contributions of these individuals and others and their work regarding global considerations since many of the issues with which the environmental justice movement is concerned are also contained within movements outside the United States dialogue and debate.

2. History of the Environmental Justice Movement

The environmental justice movement originated with the passing of the Civil Rights Act of 1964 and of Title VI, which prohibited the use of federal funds to discriminate on the basis of race, color and national origin.  The movement is also related to the work of Dr. Martin Luther King in the late 1960’s and his efforts on behalf of black sanitation workers in the city of Memphis, Tennessee.  In 1969, Ralph Abascal of the California Rural Legal Assistance filed a suit on behalf of six migrant farm workers, which resulted in the banning of the pesticide DDT. In addition, Congress passed the National Environmental Policy Act (NEPA) that same year.  In 1971, the President’s Council on Environmental Quality (CEQ) acknowledged racial discrimination which adversely affected urban poor and the quality of their environment.  In 1978, the Houston Northwood Manor subdivision residents protested the Whispering Pines Sanitary Landfill and in 1979 Linda McKeever Bullard filed a lawsuit on behalf of Houston’s Northeast Community Action Group. This lawsuit, titled Bean v. Southwestern Waste Management Inc, constituted the first civil rights suit challenging the siting of a waste facility.  The United Church of Christ Commission for Racial Justice issued the “Toxic Waste and Race in the United States” report in 1987.  The report was the first national study exposing the relationship between waste facility location and race.  The Clean Air Act was passed in 1990 and Bullard’s book Dumping in Dixie was published in the same year.  This particular work constituted the first textbook on environmental justice.  The first National People of Color Environmental Leadership Summit was held in Washington in 1991.  In 1994, The Environmental Justice Resource Center was formed at Clark Atlanta University in Atlanta, Georgia.  In addition, during the same year the Washington Office on Environmental Justice (WOEJ) opened in Washington D.C.  The United States environmental justice movement progressed onto the global stage in 1995 when environmental justice delegates participated in the 4th World Conference on Women in Beijing.

The environmental justice movement has existed for more than two decades, reaching an apex in the 1990’s. The movement emerged from an increased awareness of the disproportionately high impacts of environmental pollution on economically and politically disadvantaged communities. It addresses issues such as social, economic and political marginalization of minorities and low income populations, and is also concerned with the perceived increase of pollution not only in neighborhoods and communities, but also in the workplace.

There is no specific founding point for the environmental justice movement, but it was largely created through the fusion of two other movements — the economic analysis of the anti-toxics movement and the racial critique of the Civil Rights movement — and the over-arching perspective of a third — faith. Other strong contributions have come from  academia, from Native Americans, and the labor. (Timeline)

African Americans did not significantly challenge the environmental problems adversely affecting their communities prior to the call for environmental justice.  The shift from denial to acknowledgment and action emerged during the 1980’s.  Until that time African American resistance was largely limited to concern with local issues and generally was concerned with the individualistic nature of the African American struggle for equality.  However, in the 1980’s a transition took place which would give rise to the environmental justice movement as an extension of the Civil Rights movement.  This shift took place under the designation of “environmental activism” (DD, 29).

The environmental justice movement is credited with having begun in Warren County, North Carolina. In this locale residents demonstrated against a landfill which would be placed in their county. The reaction of the citizens concerning the issue reflected the merging of civil rights activists and environmentalists. Representatives from these two groups are alleged to have laid down in front of trucks transferring large amounts of PCB-contaminated soil into the largely African American populated area of Warren County. While the Warren County demonstrations were unsuccessful, they did achieve the result of bringing a renewed focus to the issue of the disproportionately high impact of environmental pollution upon minority communities such as Warren County. Ultimately, this event also placed environmental justice concerns onto the political agenda.

In 1992, a National Law Journal report alleged that the Environmental Protection Agency (EPA) had discriminated in its enforcement of environmental protection law thereby supporting the observations of those among whom the movement originally emerged.  The report indicated that federal fines were more lax for industries operating in communities of color. In addition, the report also contended that the cleanup of environmental disasters in communities of color were much slower than those carried out in the context of wealthier white communities.  Furthermore, the report indicated that standards for clean up in communities of color were not as well established or rigid as those applied in white communities.

3. Environmental Racism and Environmental Justice

Environmental justice advocates argue that an intimate relationship exists between the trilogy of environmental racism, environmental discrimination, and environmental policymaking.  Environmental injustice and environmental racism have their roots in a politico-institutional context bent toward discrimination.  Municipal, state, and federal regulations are, therefore, aimed at permitting, condoning and even promoting environmental racism.

In addition, environmental justice proponents contend that governmental policy is also bent toward the deliberate targeting of communities of color for toxic waste disposal and also the establishing of polluting industries in those communities. Further, policy and legislation not only permit but also endorse the official sanctioning of life-threatening poisons and pollutants being located in communities of color. Environmental justice advocates also contend that residents of victimized people groups are ostracized from access to political power and consequently have been excluded from service on decision-making boards and regulatory bodies, thereby subtly yet deliberately promoting environmental injustice and environmental racism.  Each of these elements contributes to the existence and propagation of environmental injustice and environmental racism (CER, 3).

Environmental justice proponents contend, "Experiences of environmental racism and injustice are not random, nor are they individual." Consequently, the environmental justice movement is concerned with these two matters, collectivism and perceived intentionality.  On the one hand, environmental justice advocates concern themselves with environmental injustice as it happens to groups; and on the other hand, environmental justice advocates are also concerned with the systemic causes of environmental injustice (Rasmussen, 3-4).

Robert Bullard states that race is a major factor in predicting the placement of Locally Unwanted Land Uses (LULUs). Some would contend that socio-economic class is the central issue, however. Bullard counters that while race and class are combined factors, race is still the predominant factor. Environmental justice activists pronounce that race dominates policy decisions made by those in positions of power since the power arrangements of socio-economic institutions are out of balance.

Bullard also advances that environmental justice is not a social program, nor is it an affirmative action program and also that ultimately the central concern of the movement is the implementation of justice.  In addition, Bullard maintains that the consideration of race in the environmental justice movement, while constituting a portion of the problematic equation associated with environmental injustice is not the only concern of the movement.

We are just as much concerned with inequities in Appalachia, for example, where the whites are basically dumped on because of lack of economic and political clout and lack of having a voice to say 'no' and that's environmental injustice.  We are trying to work with folks across the political spectrums; democrats, republicans, independents, on the reservations, in the barrios, in the ghettos, on the border and internationally to se what we address these issues in a comprehensive manner. (Interview)

However, in his earlier work entitled Confronting Environmental Racism: Voices from the Grassroots, Bullard does give voice to his belief that the problem of environmental injustice is to a large extent a racially oriented problem and that this is a problem which communities of color face.  He couches his discussion concerning environmental justice in the context of the recognition that at the heart of the problem of environmental injustice is a racially divided nation in which extreme racial inequalities persist.  However, by the time of Bullard’s more major work entitled Dumping in Dixie, he had acknowledged that the reality of environmental injustice transcends the issue of the victimization of any one race or ethnic group (CER, 7).

4. Principles of the Environmental Justice Movement

The result of the 1992 National Law Journal report concluded that the EPA had discriminated in its enforcement of Environmental Protection Law Report, which was intended to remedy the reality of environmental racism in the United States. Consequently, in 1991 at the First National People of Color Leadership Summit meeting in Washington D.C., the Principles of Environmental Justice were adopted.  These principles represent an initial rallying cry on behalf of those inhabitants, human and non-human, who are the victims of environmental injustice, and eventually established a context for a guide to action regarding governmental legislation.  Those principles are:

  1. Environmental justice affirms the sacredness of Mother Earth, ecological unity and the interdependence of all species, and the right to be free from ecological destruction.
  2. Environmental justice demands that public policy be based on mutual respect and justice for all peoples, free from any form of discrimination or bias.
  3. Environmental justice mandates the right to ethical, balanced and responsible uses of land and renewable resources in the interest of a sustainable planet for humans and other living things.
  4. Environmental justice calls for universal protection from nuclear testing, extraction, production and disposal of toxic/hazardous wastes and poisons and nuclear testing that threaten the fundamental right to clean air, land, water, and food.
  5. Environmental justice affirms the fundamental right to political, economic, cultural and environmental self-determination of all peoples.
  6. Environmental justice demands the cessation of the production of all toxins, hazardous wastes, and radioactive materials, and that all past and current producers be held strictly accountable to the people for detoxification and the containment at the point of production.
  7. Environmental justice demands the right to participate as equal partners at every level of decision-making including needs assessment, planning, implementation, enforcement and evaluation.
  8. Environmental justice affirms the right of all workers to a safe and healthy work environment, without being forced to choose between an unsafe livelihood and unemployment. It also affirms the right of those who work at home to be free from environmental hazards.
  9. Environmental justice protects the right of victims of environmental injustice to receive full compensation and reparations for damages as well as quality health care.
  10. Environmental justice considers governmental acts of environmental injustice a violation of international law, the Universal Declaration on Human Rights, and the United Nations Convention on Genocide.
  11. Environmental justice must recognize a special legal and natural relationship of Native Peoples to the U.S. government through treaties, agreements, compacts, and covenants affirming sovereignty and self-determination.
  12. Environmental justice affirms the need for urban and rural ecological policies to clean up and rebuild our cities and rural areas in balance with nature, honoring the cultural integrity of all our communities, and providing fair access for all to the full range of resources.
  13. Environmental justice calls for the strict enforcement of principles of informed consent, and a halt to the testing of experimental reproductive and medical procedures and vaccinations on people of color.
  14. Environmental justice opposes the destructive operations of multi-national corporations.
  15. Environmental justice opposes military occupation, repression and exploitation of lands, peoples and cultures, and other life forms.
  16. Environmental justice calls for the education of present and future generations, which emphasizes social and environmental issues, based on our experience and an appreciation of our diverse cultural perspectives.
  17. Environmental justice requires that we, as individuals, make personal and consumer choices to consume as little of Mother Earth's resources and to produce as little waste as possible; and make the conscious decision to challenge and reprioritize our lifestyles to insure the health of the natural world for present and future generations (ejnet).

The First National People of Color Leadership Summit brought together hundreds of environmental justice activists representing both the national as well as the global stage.  The objective of the conference was to advocate for local and regional environmental justice activism in the form of both regional and ethnic networks. The Summit led to the creation of the Asian Pacific Environmental Network, the Northeast Environmental Justice Network, the Southern Organizing Committee for Economic and Environmental Justice and the Midwest/Great Lakes Environmental Justice Network. In 1993 Max Baucus, Democrat from Montana introduced the Environmental Justice Act of 1993 that addressed assertions that poor and minority areas are disproportionately affected by environmental pollution.  Representative John Lewis, Democrat from Georgia introduced a similar bill in the House of Representatives.

5. Causes of Environmental Injustice

Environmental injustice is said to exist when members of disadvantaged ethnic minority or other groups suffer disproportionately at the local, regional (subnational), or national levels from environmental risks or hazards or from violations of fundamental human rights as a result of environmental factors.  In addition, environmental injustice has occurred when an individual or group of individuals is denied access to environmental investments, benefits, and natural resources.  Furthermore, environmental injustice has taken place when individuals or collective groups are denied access to information, and/or participation in decision-making, as well as access to justice in environment-related matters. The study of environmental injustice has the responsibilities of examining the hierarchies of power that are inherent in any given socio-cultural context and the manner in which those hierarchies not only tolerate but also propagate environmental injustice against any number of disadvantaged people groups (EIPS, 2).

One cause of environmental injustice is institutionalized racism.  Institutionalized racism is defined as the practical reality of deliberately and intentionally targeting neighborhoods and communities comprised of a majority of people of low socio-economic status and of a collective group of individuals of color and is considered to be the natural outgrowth of racism. According to environmental justice proponents, this racism has become acculturated and engrained in contemporary social institutions, not the least of which is a governmental bureaucracy on the municipal, state, and federal levels which not only permits but reinforces the imposition of environmental injustice upon these groups.  Bunyan Bryant defines environmental racism as "the systematic exclusion of people of color from environmental decisions affecting their communities" (Bryant, 5 and Rasmussen, 8).

Another factor leading to the reality of environmental injustice is the commoditization of land, water, energy and air. This has resulted in their being secured and protected for the benefit of those in power over those who lack power.  Advocates of environmental justice remind that regardless of our status in life, we all exist collectively within the context of this biosphere.  Therefore "we breathe the same air, share the same atmosphere with the same ozone layer and climate patterns, eat food from the same soils and seas, and harvest the same acid rain" (Rasmussen, 8).

In addition, the unresponsive and unaccountable governmental policies and regulations which exist at all levels of government contribute to environmental racism and environmental injustice. Government authorities are frequently unresponsive to community needs regarding environmental inequities due to the existence of an oppressive power structure.  Furthermore, governmental availability to powerful corporations who exert power as an act of self-interest also poses problems.  Consequently, the victims of environmental injustice find it difficult if not impossible to use governmental resources and power to advance their cause (Rasmussen, 8).

Moreover, the lack of resources and power in affected communities is a major contributor to the presence of environmental racism.  In addition to the previous obstacles is the common denominator of powerlessness on the part of the victimized on the basis of few financial resources to invest in the struggle for environmental justice and also the lack of power by the victims of environmental injustice.  Specifically, the groups adversely affected by environmental inequities lack the capacity to function as an organized block representing their interests against those in the contest of authority and affluence (Rasmussen, 8).

Finally, a piecemeal approach to regulation which allows loopholes and the consequent ongoing victimization of low-income populations of color contributes to the reality of environmental racism.  The ongoing process of governmental regulation also poses a problem in combating environmental injustice and the implementation of environmental justice.  The consequent gaps between pieces of legislation which are passed in an effort to combat environmental injustice frequently provide a context for the skirting the intent of this legislation (Rasmussen, 8).

6. Major Events in the Environmental Justice Movement

A major event contributing to the development of the environmental movement in the United States was the National Environmental Policy Act of 1969 (NEPA).  The Act established a foundation for United States environmental policy and required that "any major federal action significantly affecting the quality of the human environment" requires evaluation and public disclosure of potential environmental impact through the required Environmental Impact Statement (EIS).  The EIS required by NEPA applies broadly to such categories as highways and other forms of transit projects and programs, natural resource leasing and extraction, industrial farming and policies governing genetically modified crops, as well as large scale urban development projects (NEPA 1969).  NEPA was signed into law on January 1, 1970. The Act establishes national environmental policy and goals for the protection, maintenance, and enhancement of the environment and it provides a process for implementing these goals within the federal agencies.

NEPA also established the Council on Environmental Quality (CEQ).  In its 1971 annual report, CEQ noted that populations of low-income people of color were disproportionately exposed to significant environmental hazards. This recognition constitutes the earliest governmental report acknowledging the existence of what may be termed environmental inequality in the United States.  In 1983 Robert Bullard published his groundbreaking case study of waste disposal practices in Houston, Texas entitled "Solid Waste Sites and the Black Houston Community." The case study resulted in the publication of Bullard's Dumping in Dixie: Race, Class, and Environmental Quality in1990. Bullard's original study discovered that waste sites were not scattered on a random basis throughout the city of Houston, but that they were more likely to be located in African American neighborhoods and even more shockingly near schools.  Bullard's work was the first actual study to examine the causes of environmental racism.  Bullard discovered a multiplicity of factors which led to the environmental inequality including housing discrimination, lack of zoning and racially and socio-economically insensitive decisions made by public officials over a period of fifty years.

In 1983, further documenting the realities of environmental discrimination, a congressionally authorized U.S. General Accounting Office study uncovered that three out of four off-site, commercial hazardous waste landfills in the southeastern United States were located within predominately African American communities. This was the reality despite the fact that African Americans made up only one-fifth of the region’s population. In 1990, sociologist Robert Bullard published his influential work entitled Dumping in Dixie.His was the first major study of environmental racism linking hazardous facility locations with historical patterns of segregation in the South. In addition, Bullard's study was one of the first to explore the social and psychological impacts of environmental racism on local populations, as well as acknowledging the emerging environmental justice movement as a response from the communities against these increasingly documented environmental threats.

On February 11, 1994, President Bill Clinton signed Executive Order 12898, Federal Actions to Address Environmental Justice in Minority Populations and Low-Income Populations, to focus federal attention on the environmental and human health conditions of minority and low-income populations with the goal of achieving environmental protection for all communities. The Order directed federal agencies to develop environmental justice strategies to help federal agencies address disproportionately high and adverse human health or environmental effects of their programs on minority and low-income populations. The order is also intended to promote nondiscrimination in federal programs that affect human health and the environment. It aims to provide minority and low-income communities with access to public information and public participation in matters relating to human health and the environment. The Presidential Memorandum accompanying the Order underscores certain provisions of existing law that can help ensure that all communities and persons across the nation live in a safe and healthy environment. Also in 1994, The Environmental Protection Agency renamed the Office of Environmental Equity as the Office of Environmental Justice. The Environmental Justice Act of 1999 introduced into the U.S. Legislature was also a sign of significant progress. In 2003 the EPA established the environmental justice bibliographic database.

7. Environmental Justice Policy and Law

The environmental justice movement credits its momentum and effectiveness to the U.S. Constitution and three significant pieces of legislation: Title VI 601; 602; and 42 U.S.C. 1983.

The Fourteenth Amendment and Equal Protection

Prior to the establishing of terms such as "environmental justice" or environmental racism", residents living in minority communities who believed they were the victims of unfair environmental policy brought fourteenth amendment actions before local municipalities seeking fair treatment. In Dowdell v. City of Apopka, 1983, discrimination in street paving, water distribution, and storm draining services was established. In United Farm Workers of Florida v. City of Delray Beach, 1974 it was established that there were violations of farm workers' civil rights by city officials. In Johnson v. City of Arcadia, 1978 the court found discrimination in access to paved streets, parks, and the water supply.  The Supreme Court's decision in Washington v. Davis, 1976 announced the rule that impermissible discrimination under the Fourteenth Amendment requires a showing of intent, not simply of disparate impact.  In Village of Arlington Heights v. Metropolitan Housing Development Co., 1977 the Court established a set of factors to determine whether invidious discrimination underlies an otherwise legitimate exercise of government authority.

Title VI, Civil Rights Act 601, 602, and 42 U.S.C. 198

Title VI, Civil Rights Act 601 states, "no person in the United States shall on the grounds of race, color or national origin be excluded from participation in, be denied the benefits of, or be subjected to discrimination under any program or activity receiving federal financial assistance.” (U.S.C. 1994) Title VI, Civil rights Act 602 requires "agencies that disperse federal funds to promulgate regulations implementing Title VI Civil rights Act and to create an enforcement framework that details the manner in which discrimination claims will be processed" (Shanahan, 403-406).

In addition to the two foregoing Acts, environmental justice advocates also use 42 U.S.C. 1983 in order to establish that the effect of the agencies’ decision will have a negative impact on the community.  42 U.S.C. 1983 states:

Every person who, under color of any statute, ordinance, regulation, custom, or usage, of any State or Territory or the District of Columbia, subjects, or causes to be subjected, any citizen of the United States or other person within the jurisdiction thereof to the deprivation of any rights, privileges, or immunities secured by the Constitution and laws, shall be liable to the party injured in an action at law (U.S.C. 1983).

These pieces of legislation were beneficial to the environmental justice movement until 2001 when the Supreme Court, in Alexander v. Sandoval held that “602 does not provide an implied private right of action to enforce disparate impact regulations promoted by federal agencies pursuant to 602.”

8. References and Further Reading

a. Books

  • Bullard Robert, Dumping in Dixie: Race, Class, and Environmental Quality. Westview Press, 2000. (cited as DD)
  • Bullard, Robert, Confronting Environmental Racism: Voices from the Grassroots. South End Press, 1993. (cited as CER)
  • Bryant, Bunyan, ed. Environmental Justice: Issues, Problems, and Solutions. Island Press, 1995. (cited as EJ)
  • Camacho, David E. Environmental Injustices, Political Struggles: Race, Class, and the Environment. Duke University Press, 1988.  (cited as EIPS)
  • Rawls, John, Theory of Justice 2nd Edition Oxford University Press, 1999. (cited as TJ)
  • Rawls, Justice as Fairness: A Re-statement. Belknap Press, 2001. (cited as JF)

b. Journals

  • Environmental Justice: An Interview with Robert Bullard, Earth First Journal, July 1999. (cited as Interview)
  • Drummond, Celia Deane, “Environmental Justice and the Economy: A Christian Theologians Views” Ecotheology 11.3 2006: 24-34 (Deane Drummond)
  • Lee, Charles, “environmental justice: Building a Unified Vision of Health and the Environment” Environmental Health Perspectives 10, Supplement 2 (April 2002), 141-144.
  • Rasmussen, Larry, “Environmental Racism and environmental justice: Moral Theory in the Making? Journal of the Society of Christian Ethics 24 1 (2004): 11-28. (cited as Rasmussen)
  • Shanahan, Alice M. “Permitting Justice: EPA’s Revised Guidance for Investigating Title VI Administrative Complaints. ENVTL. LAWYER 403, 406 (Feb. 2001) (citing the Civil Rights Act of 1964, §602, 78 Stat. at 252-253). (cited as Shanahan)

c. Governmental and Legal Publications

  • 42 U.S.C. § 1983 (2002). (cited as U.S.C. 1983)
  • 42 U.S.C. § 2000 (d) (1994). (cited as U.S.C. 1994)
  • Alexander v. Sandoval 532 U.S. 275 (cited as Alexander)

Author Information

Eddy F. Carder
Prairie View A & M University
U. S. A.

Philosophy of Love

This article examines the nature of love and some of the ethical and political ramifications. For the philosopher, the question “what is love?” generates a host of issues: love is an abstract noun which means for some it is a word unattached to anything real or sensible, that is all; for others, it is a means by which our being – our self and its world – are irrevocably affected once we are ‘touched by love’; some have sought to analyze it, others have preferred to leave it in the realm of the ineffable.

Yet it is undeniable that love plays an enormous and unavoidable role in our several cultures; we find it discussed in song, film, and novels – humorously or seriously; it is a constant theme of maturing life and a vibrant theme for youth. Philosophically, the nature of love has, since the time of the Ancient Greeks, been a mainstay in philosophy, producing theories that range from the materialistic conception of love as purely a physical phenomenon – an animalistic or genetic urge that dictates our behavior – to theories of love as an intensely spiritual affair that in its highest permits us to touch divinity. Historically, in the Western tradition, Plato’s Symposium presents the initiating text, for it provides us with an enormously influential and attractive notion that love is characterized by a series of elevations, in which animalistic desire or base lust is superseded by a more intellectual conception of love which also is surpassed by what may be construed by a theological vision of love that transcends sensual attraction and mutuality. Since then there have been detractors and supporters of Platonic love as well as a host of alternative theories – including that of Plato’s student, Aristotle and his more secular theory of true love reflecting what he described as ‘two bodies and one soul.’

The philosophical treatment of love transcends a variety of sub-disciplines including epistemology, metaphysics, religion, human nature, politics and ethics. Often statements or arguments concerning love, its nature and role in human life for example connect to one or all the central theories of philosophy, and is often compared with, or examined in the context of, the philosophies of sex and gender as well as body and intentionality. The task of a philosophy of love is to present the appropriate issues in a cogent manner, drawing on relevant theories of human nature, desire, ethics, and so on.

Table of Contents

  1. The Nature of Love: Eros, Philia, and Agape
    1. Eros
    2. Philia
    3. Agape
  2. The Nature of Love: Further Conceptual Considerations
  3. The Nature of Love: Romantic Love
  4. The Nature of Love: Physical, Emotional, Spiritual
  5. Love: Ethics and Politics
  6. References and Further Reading

1. The Nature of Love: Eros, Philia, and Agape

The philosophical discussion regarding love logically begins with questions concerning its nature. This implies that love has a "nature," a proposition that some may oppose arguing that love is conceptually irrational, in the sense that it cannot be described in rational or meaningful propositions. For such critics, who are presenting a metaphysical and epistemological argument, love may be an ejection of emotions that defy rational examination; on the other hand, some languages, such as Papuan, do not even admit the concept, which negates the possibility of a philosophical examination. In English, the word "love," which is derived from Germanic forms of the Sanskrit lubh (desire), is broadly defined and hence imprecise, which generates first order problems of definition and meaning, which are resolved to some extent by the reference to the Greek terms, eros, philia, and agape.

a. Eros

The term eros (Greek erasthai) is used to refer to that part of love constituting a passionate, intense desire for something; it is often referred to as a sexual desire, hence the modern notion of "erotic" (Greek erotikos). In Plato's writings however, eros is held to be a common desire that seeks transcendental beauty-the particular beauty of an individual reminds us of true beauty that exists in the world of Forms or Ideas (Phaedrus 249E: "he who loves the beautiful is called a lover because he partakes of it." Trans. Jowett). The Platonic-Socratic position maintains that the love we generate for beauty on this earth can never be truly satisfied until we die; but in the meantime we should aspire beyond the particular stimulating image in front of us to the contemplation of beauty in itself.

The implication of the Platonic theory of eros is that ideal beauty, which is reflected in the particular images of beauty we find, becomes interchangeable across people and things, ideas, and art: to love is to love the Platonic form of beauty-not a particular individual, but the element they posses of true (Ideal) beauty. Reciprocity is not necessary to Plato's view of love, for the desire is for the object (of Beauty), than for, say, the company of another and shared values and pursuits.

Many in the Platonic vein of philosophy hold that love is an intrinsically higher value than appetitive or physical desire. Physical desire, they note, is held in common with the animal kingdom. Hence, it is of a lower order of reaction and stimulus than a rationally induced love---that is, a love produced by rational discourse and exploration of ideas, which in turn defines the pursuit of Ideal beauty. Accordingly, the physical love of an object, an idea, or a person in itself is not a proper form of love, love being a reflection of that part of the object, idea, or person, that partakes in Ideal beauty.

b. Philia

In contrast to the desiring and passionate yearning of eros, philia entails a fondness and appreciation of the other. For the Greeks, the term philia incorporated not just friendship, but also loyalties to family and polis-one's political community, job, or discipline. Philia for another may be motivated, as Aristotle explains in the Nicomachean Ethics, Book VIII, for the agent's sake or for the other's own sake. The motivational distinctions are derived from love for another because the friendship is wholly useful as in the case of business contacts, or because their character and values are pleasing (with the implication that if those attractive habits change, so too does the friendship), or for the other in who they are in themselves, regardless of one's interests in the matter. The English concept of friendship roughly captures Aristotle's notion of philia, as he writes: "things that cause friendship are: doing kindnesses; doing them unasked; and not proclaiming the fact when they are done" (Rhetoric, II. 4, trans. Rhys Roberts).

Aristotle elaborates on the kinds of things we seek in proper friendship, suggesting that the proper basis for philia is objective: those who share our dispositions, who bear no grudges, who seek what we do, who are temperate, and just, who admire us appropriately as we admire them, and so on. Philia could not emanate from those who are quarrelsome, gossips, aggressive in manner and personality, who are unjust, and so on. The best characters, it follows, may produce the best kind of friendship and hence love: indeed, how to be a good character worthy of philia is the theme of the Nicomachaen Ethics. The most rational man is he who would be the happiest, and he, therefore, who is capable of the best form of friendship, which between two "who are good, and alike in virtue" is rare (NE, VIII.4 trans. Ross). We can surmise that love between such equals-Aristotle's rational and happy men-would be perfect, with circles of diminishing quality for those who are morally removed from the best. He characterizes such love as "a sort of excess of feeling". (NE, VIII.6)

Friendships of a lesser quality may also be based on the pleasure or utility that is derived from another's company. A business friendship is based on utility--on mutual reciprocity of similar business interests; once the business is at an end, then the friendship dissolves. This is similar to those friendships based on the pleasure that is derived from the other's company, which is not a pleasure enjoyed for whom the other person is in himself, but in the flow of pleasure from his actions or humour.

The first condition for the highest form of Aristotelian love is that a man loves himself. Without an egoistic basis, he cannot extend sympathy and affection to others (NE, IX.8). Such self-love is not hedonistic, or glorified, depending on the pursuit of immediate pleasures or the adulation of the crowd, it is instead a reflection of his pursuit of the noble and virtuous, which culminate in the pursuit of the reflective life. Friendship with others is required "since his purpose is to contemplate worthy actions... to live pleasantly... sharing in discussion and thought" as is appropriate for the virtuous man and his friend (NE, IX.9). The morally virtuous man deserves in turn the love of those below him; he is not obliged to give an equal love in return, which implies that the Aristotelian concept of love is elitist or perfectionist: "In all friendships implying inequality the love also should be proportional, i.e. the better should be more loved than he loves." (NE, VIII, 7,). Reciprocity, although not necessarily equal, is a condition of Aristotelian love and friendship, although parental love can involve a one-sided fondness.

c. Agape

Agape refers to the paternal love of God for man and of man for God but is extended to include a brotherly love for all humanity. (The Hebrew ahev has a slightly wider semantic range than agape). Agape arguably draws on elements from both eros and philia in that it seeks a perfect kind of love that is at once a fondness, a transcending of the particular, and a passion without the necessity of reciprocity. The concept is expanded on in the Judaic-Christian tradition of loving God: "You shall love the Lord your God with all your heart, and with all your soul, and with all your might" (Deuteronomy 6:5) and loving "thy neighbour as thyself" (Leviticus 19:18). The love of God requires absolute devotion that is reminiscent of Plato's love of Beauty (and Christian translators of Plato such as St. Augustine employed the connections), which involves an erotic passion, awe, and desire that transcends earthly cares and obstacles. Aquinas, on the other hand, picked up on the Aristotelian theories of friendship and love to proclaim God as the most rational being and hence the most deserving of one's love, respect, and considerations.

The universalist command to "love thy neighbor as thyself" refers the subject to those surrounding him, whom he should love unilaterally if necessary. The command employs the logic of mutual reciprocity, and hints at an Aristotelian basis that the subject should love himself in some appropriate manner: for awkward results would ensue if he loved himself in a particularly inappropriate, perverted manner! (Philosophers can debate the nature of "self-love" implied in this-from the Aristotelian notion that self-love is necessary for any kind of interpersonal love, to the condemnation of egoism and the impoverished examples that pride and self-glorification from which to base one's love of another. St. Augustine relinquishes the debate--he claims that no command is needed for a man to love himself (De bono viduitatis, xxi.) Analogous to the logic of "it is better to give than to receive", the universalism of agape requires an initial invocation from someone: in a reversal of the Aristotelian position, the onus for the Christian is on the morally superior to extend love to others. Nonetheless, the command also entails an egalitarian love-hence the Christian code to "love thy enemies" (Matthew 5:44-45). Such love transcends any perfectionist or aristocratic notions that some are (or should be) more loveable than others. Agape finds echoes in the ethics of Kant and Kierkegaard, who assert the moral importance of giving impartial respect or love to another person qua human being in the abstract.

However, loving one's neighbor impartially (James 2:9) invokes serious ethical concerns, especially if the neighbor ostensibly does not warrant love. Debate thus begins on what elements of a neighbor's conduct should be included in agape, and which should be excluded. Early Christians asked whether the principle applied only to disciples of Christ or to all. The impartialists won the debate asserting that the neighbor's humanity provides the primary condition of being loved; nonetheless his actions may require a second order of criticisms, for the logic of brotherly love implies that it is a moral improvement on brotherly hate. For metaphysical dualists, loving the soul rather than the neighbor's body or deeds provides a useful escape clause-or in turn the justification for penalizing the other's body for sin and moral transgressions, while releasing the proper object of love-the soul-from its secular torments. For Christian pacifists, "turning the other cheek" to aggression and violence implies a hope that the aggressor will eventually learn to comprehend the higher values of peace, forgiveness, and a love for humanity.

The universalism of agape runs counter to the partialism of Aristotle and poses a variety of ethical implications. Aquinas admits a partialism in love towards those we are related while maintaining that we should be charitable to all, whereas others such as Kierkegaard insist on impartiality. Recently, Hugh LaFallotte (1991) has noted that to love those one is partial towards is not necessarily a negation of the impartiality principle, for impartialism could admit loving those closer to one as an impartial principle, and, employing Aristotle's conception of self-love, iterates that loving others requires an intimacy that can only be gained from being partially intimate. Others would claim that the concept of universal love, of loving all equally, is not only impracticable, but logically empty-Aristotle, for example, argues: "One cannot be a friend to many people in the sense of having friendship of the perfect type with them, just as one cannot be in love with many people at once (for love is a sort of excess of feeling, and it is the nature of such only to be felt towards one person)" (NE, VIII.6).

2. The Nature of Love: Further Conceptual Considerations

Presuming love has a nature, it should be, to some extent at least, describable within the concepts of language. But what is meant by an appropriate language of description may be as philosophically beguiling as love itself. Such considerations invoke the philosophy of language, of the relevance and appropriateness of meanings, but they also provide the analysis of "love" with its first principles. Does it exist and if so, is it knowable, comprehensible, and describable? Love may be knowable and comprehensible to others, as understood in the phrases, "I am in love", "I love you", but what "love" means in these sentences may not be analyzed further: that is, the concept "love" is irreducible-an axiomatic, or self-evident, state of affairs that warrants no further intellectual intrusion, an apodictic category perhaps, that a Kantian may recognize.

The epistemology of love asks how we may know love, how we may understand it, whether it is possible or plausible to make statements about others or ourselves being in love (which touches on the philosophical issue of private knowledge versus public behavior). Again, the epistemology of love is intimately connected to the philosophy of language and theories of the emotions. If love is purely an emotional condition, it is plausible to argue that it remains a private phenomenon incapable of being accessed by others, except through an expression of language, and language may be a poor indicator of an emotional state both for the listener and the subject. Emotivists would hold that a statement such as "I am in love" is irreducible to other statements because it is a nonpropositional utterance, hence its veracity is beyond examination. Phenomenologists may similarly present love as a non-cognitive phenomenon. Scheler, for example, toys with Plato's Ideal love, which is cognitive, claiming: "love itself... brings about the continuous emergence of ever-higher value in the object--just as if it were streaming out from the object of its own accord, without any exertion (even of wishing) on the part of the lover" (1954, p. 57). The lover is passive before the beloved.

The claim that "love" cannot be examined is different from that claiming "love" should not be subject to examination-that it should be put or left beyond the mind's reach, out of a dutiful respect for its mysteriousness, its awesome, divine, or romantic nature. But if it is agreed that there is such a thing as "love" conceptually speaking, when people present statements concerning love, or admonitions such as "she should show more love," then a philosophical examination seems appropriate: is it synonymous with certain patterns of behavior, of inflections in the voice or manner, or by the apparent pursuit and protection of a particular value ("Look at how he dotes upon his flowers-he must love them")?

If love does possesses "a nature" which is identifiable by some means-a personal expression, a discernible pattern of behavior, or other activity, it can still be asked whether that nature can be properly understood by humanity. Love may have a nature, yet we may not possess the proper intellectual capacity to understand it-accordingly, we may gain glimpses perhaps of its essence-as Socrates argues in The Symposium, but its true nature being forever beyond humanity's intellectual grasp. Accordingly, love may be partially described, or hinted at, in a dialectic or analytical exposition of the concept but never understood in itself. Love may therefore become an epiphenomenal entity, generated by human action in loving, but never grasped by the mind or language. Love may be so described as a Platonic Form, belonging to the higher realm of transcendental concepts that mortals can barely conceive of in their purity, catching only glimpses of the Forms' conceptual shadows that logic and reason unveil or disclose.

Another view, again derived from Platonic philosophy, may permit love to be understood by certain people and not others. This invokes a hierarchical epistemology, that only the initiated, the experienced, the philosophical, or the poetical or musical, may gain insights into its nature. On one level this admits that only the experienced can know its nature, which is putatively true of any experience, but it also may imply a social division of understanding-that only philosopher kings may know true love. On the first implication, those who do not feel or experience love are incapable (unless initiated through rite, dialectical philosophy, artistic processes, and so on) of comprehending its nature, whereas the second implication suggests (though this is not a logically necessary inference) that the non-initiated, or those incapable of understanding, feel only physical desire and not "love." Accordingly, "love" belongs either to the higher faculties of all, understanding of which requires being educated in some manner or form, or it belongs to the higher echelons of society-to a priestly, philosophical, or artistic, poetic class. The uninitiated, the incapable, or the young and inexperienced-those who are not romantic troubadours-are doomed only to feel physical desire. This separating of love from physical desire has further implications concerning the nature of romantic love.

3. The Nature of Love: Romantic Love

Romantic love is deemed to be of a higher metaphysical and ethical status than sexual or physical attractiveness alone. The idea of romantic love initially stems from the Platonic tradition that love is a desire for beauty-a value that transcends the particularities of the physical body. For Plato, the love of beauty culminates in the love of philosophy, the subject that pursues the highest capacity of thinking. The romantic love of knights and damsels emerged in the early medieval ages (11th Century France, fine amour) a philosophical echo of both Platonic and Aristotelian love and literally a derivative of the Roman poet, Ovid and his Ars Amatoria. Romantic love theoretically was not to be consummated, for such love was transcendentally motivated by a deep respect for the lady; however, it was to be actively pursued in chivalric deeds rather than contemplated-which is in contrast to Ovid's persistent sensual pursuit of conquests!

Modern romantic love returns to Aristotle's version of the special love two people find in each other's virtues-one soul and two bodies, as he poetically puts it. It is deemed to be of a higher status, ethically, aesthetically, and even metaphysically than the love that behaviorists or physicalists describe.

4. The Nature of Love: Physical, Emotional, Spiritual

Some may hold that love is physical, i.e., that love is nothing but a physical response to another whom the agent feels physically attracted to. Accordingly, the action of loving encompasses a broad range of behavior including caring, listening, attending to, preferring to others, and so on. (This would be proposed by behaviorists). Others (physicalists, geneticists) reduce all examinations of love to the physical motivation of the sexual impulse-the simple sexual instinct that is shared with all complex living entities, which may, in humans, be directed consciously, sub-consciously or pre-rationally toward a potential mate or object of sexual gratification.

Physical determinists, those who believe the world to entirely physical and that every event has a prior (physical cause), consider love to be an extension of the chemical-biological constituents of the human creature and be explicable according to such processes. In this vein, geneticists may invoke the theory that the genes (an individual's DNA) form the determining criteria in any sexual or putative romantic choice, especially in choosing a mate. However, a problem for those who claim that love is reducible to the physical attractiveness of a potential mate, or to the blood ties of family and kin which forge bonds of filial love, is that it does not capture the affections between those who cannot or wish not to reproduce-that is, physicalism or determinism ignores the possibility of romantic, ideational love---it may explain eros, but not philia or agape.

Behaviorism, which stems from the theory of the mind and asserts a rejection of Cartesian dualism between mind and body, entails that love is a series of actions and preferences which is thereby observable to oneself and others. The behaviorist theory that love is observable (according to the recognizable behavioral constraints corresponding to acts of love) suggests also that it is theoretically quantifiable: that A acts in a certain way (actions X,Y,Z) around B, more so than he does around C, suggests that he "loves" B more than C. The problem with the behaviorist vision of love is that it is susceptible to the poignant criticism that a person's actions need not express their inner state or emotions---A may be a very good actor. Radical behaviorists, such as B. F. Skinner, claim that observable and unobservable behavior such as mental states can be examined from the behaviorist framework, in terms of the laws of conditioning. On this view, that one falls in love may go unrecognised by the casual observer, but the act of being in love can be examined by what events or conditions led to the agent's believing she was in love: this may include the theory that being in love is an overtly strong reaction to a set of highly positive conditions in the behavior or presence of another.

Expressionist love is similar to behaviorism in that love is considered an expression of a state of affairs towards a beloved, which may be communicated through language (words, poetry, music) or behavior (bringing flowers, giving up a kidney, diving into the proverbial burning building), but which is a reflection of an internal, emotional state, rather than an exhibition of physical responses to stimuli. Others in this vein may claim love to be a spiritual response, the recognition of a soul that completes one's own soul, or complements or augments it. The spiritualist vision of love incorporates mystical as well as traditional romantic notions of love, but rejects the behaviorist or physicalist explanations.

Those who consider love to be an aesthetic response would hold that love is knowable through the emotional and conscious feeling it provokes yet which cannot perhaps be captured in rational or descriptive language: it is instead to be captured, as far as that is possible, by metaphor or by music.

5. Love: Ethics and Politics

The ethical aspects in love involve the moral appropriateness of loving, and the forms it should or should not take. The subject area raises such questions as: is it ethically acceptable to love an object, or to love oneself? Is love to oneself or to another a duty? Should the ethically minded person aim to love all people equally? Is partial love morally acceptable or permissible (that is, not right, but excusable)? Should love only involve those with whom the agent can have a meaningful relationship? Should love aim to transcend sexual desire or physical appearances? May notions of romantic, sexual love apply to same sex couples? Some of the subject area naturally spills into the ethics of sex, which deals with the appropriateness of sexual activity, reproduction, hetero and homosexual activity, and so on.

In the area of political philosophy, love can be studied from a variety of perspectives. For example, some may see love as an instantiation of social dominance by one group (males) over another (females), in which the socially constructed language and etiquette of love is designed to empower men and disempower women. On this theory, love is a product of patriarchy, and acts analogously to Karl Marx's view of religion (the opiate of the people) that love is the opiate of women. The implication is that were they to shrug off the language and notions of "love," "being in love," "loving someone," and so on, they would be empowered. The theory is often attractive to feminists and Marxists, who view social relations (and the entire panoply of culture, language, politics, institutions) as reflecting deeper social structures that divide people into classes, sexes, and races.

This article has touched on some of the main elements of the philosophy of love. It reaches into many philosophical fields, notably theories of human nature, the self, and of the mind. The language of love, as it is found in other languages as well as in English, is similarly broad and deserves more attention.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle Nicomachean Ethics.
  • Aristotle Rhetoric. Rhys Roberts (trans.).
  • Augustine De bono viduitatis.
  • LaFallotte, Hugh (1991). "Personal Relations." Peter Singer (ed.) A Companion to Ethics. Blackwell, pp. 327-32.
  • Plato Phaedrus.
  • Plato Symposium.
  • Scheler, Max (1954). The Nature of Sympathy. Peter Heath (trans.). New Haven: Yale University Press.

Author Information

Alexander Moseley
United Kingdom

Medieval Theories of Practical Reason

Practical reason is the employment of reason in service of living a good life, and the great medieval thinkers all gave accounts of it. Practical reason is reasoning about, or better toward, an action, and an action always has a goal or end, this end being understood to be in some sense good. The medievals generally concurred that it was always in some way directed toward the agent’s ultimate goal or final end (although there were important differences in how the agent’s relation to the final end was conceived).

In every medieval account, we find important roles for the intellect and the will—for the intellect in identifying goods to be honored and pursued, and for the will in tending toward such goods. Medieval accounts always paid attention to the relationship between practical reason and the moral trinity of happiness, law, and virtue. Perhaps the most important difference between these accounts is that some philosophers assign primacy to the intellect but others assign it to the will. This difference has led historians to identify schools of thought called intellectualism and voluntarism.

This article traces some of the main lines of medieval thought about practical reason, from its roots in Aristotle and Augustine through some of its most interesting expressions in Aquinas and Scotus, the ablest exponents, respectively, of intellectualism and voluntarism. The article points out the important differences among theorists, but also highlights the themes common to all the medieval, and it indicates some points of contact with contemporary work on practical reason, including debates about particularism and internalism.

Table of Contents

  1. Precursors: Aristotle and Augustine
    1. Aristotle
    2. Augustine
    3. Intellectualism and Voluntarism
  2. Intellectualist Theory: Aquinas
    1. The Interaction of Intellect and Will in Generating Action
    2. The Practical Syllogism
    3. Happiness, Law, and Virtue
    4. Final Comments
  3. Voluntarist Theory: Scotus
    1. Freedom of the Will
    2. Synderesis, Conscience, and the Natural Law
    3. The Non-Teleological Character of Scotus’ Thought
    4. Note on Ockham
  4. Medieval and Modern
    1. The Current Influence of Aquinas and Scotus
    2. The Medievals and Particularism
    3. The Medievals and Internalism
  5. Conclusion: Common Themes among the Medievals
  6. References and Further Reason
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1.Precursors: Aristotle and Augustine

The two most important influences upon medieval thought about practical reason were Aristotle and St. Augustine, and this first section identifies a few of the key ideas they bequeathed to their successors.

a. Aristotle

Aristotle’s theory is teleological and eudaimonist: All action is undertaken for an end, and our proximate ends, when we act rationally, form a coherent hierarchical structure leading up to our final end of eudaimonia (happiness, flourishing). Although we presuppose rather than reason about our final end formally considered—it is that which we pursue for its own sake, and for the sake of which we pursue all else; it is that which makes life worthwhile—practical reason does help us work out the correct way to think about just what that final end is, and about how to move toward it. Reason does this by means of the practical syllogism: The major premise identifies the end, some good recognized as worthy of pursuit; the minor premise interprets the agent’s situation in relation to the end; the conclusion is characteristically a choice leading directly to action that pursues means to the end (for example, Some pleasant relaxation would be good right now; reading this novel would be pleasant and relaxing; I shall read it (and straightaway I commence reading)). The work practical reason does in formulating the minor premise and identifying the means is called deliberation. While we cannot deliberate about the end identified in the major premise as an end, we can deliberate about it under its aspect as a means to some further end. Thus practical reason can (although seldom will it explicitly do so in practice) take the form of a chain of syllogisms, with the major premise of the first identifying the final end to be pursued, and the conclusion both identifying the means to that end and supplying the major premise of the next (now serving as a proximate end), until we finally reach down to something to be done here and now (the means to the most proximate end). Here is a compressed example: I should flourish as a human being, and my flourishing requires the practice of civic virtue, so I should practice civic virtue; I should practice civic virtue, in my circumstances civic virtue requires me to enlist in the army to defend my city, so I should enlist; I should enlist, and here is a recruiter to whom I must speak in order to enlist; I choose to speak to the recruiter.

Notice that in this syllogism the premises do not mention desire—the majors do not state “I want X,” but rather that X is a good to be pursued. Yet the conclusion does mention desire, or rather is a desire (for that is what choice is, deliberated desire). This is not an oversight on Aristotle's part. Although he holds that reason and desire work together to produce action, he insists that desire naturally tends to what cognition identifies as good—as he puts it at Metaphysics 1072a29, “desire is consequent upon opinion rather than opinion on desire, for the thinking is the starting point.” Reason serves as the formal cause of action by identifying the actions (determining what “form” our actions should take) leading to the apprehended good, which is the final cause or end of action; desire serves as the efficient cause, putting the man in motion toward the end. So when a prospective end is recognized as good, a desire for it follows. The practical syllogism serves to transmit the desire for the end identified by reason as good down to means identified by reason as the appropriate way to the end.

Yet, because cognition includes sense perception, things other than those identified by reason can be presented to desire as good (as any dieter knows when offered dessert). This allows Aristotle to propose a solution to the problem of akrasia or “weakness of will,” the choosing of something we know to be bad—to put it crudely, we know it is bad, but it looks good. For reasoning to be effectively practical, and for practice to be rational, the desires must be in line with reason; for the desires to be consistently in line with reason, the moral virtues, which “train” the emotions to bring them into line with reason, are necessary. When the moral virtues, together with prudence, are present, Aristotle takes it that reasoning well and acting accordingly will follow naturally (we can speak of virtue as “second nature”).

b.  Augustine

The idea of virtuous action becoming natural is one of the points on which Augustine will disagree with Aristotle. He learns from his own experience (for example, in his robbing of the pear tree recounted in Confessions II) and from his reflections on the sin of the angels (see On Free Choice of the Will III) that the will can choose what the intellect rejects. Although the intellect is required for willing in the sense that it presents objects as good to the will, willing has no cause other than the will itself. Augustine, unlike some later Augustinians, is a eudaimonist, seeing our final end as eternal life in peace, that is, in right relation to and enjoyment of God (see The City of God XIX). Yet it should be noted that, drawing on his own experience and the writings of St. Paul, he identifies “two loves” of the will, love of God and love of self, and holds that the struggle between these two for ascendancy is the key to each human life, and indeed to history. No trace of such a struggle is to be found in Aristotle; nor   is there any such role for faith as we find in Augustine. Both in Confessions XI and in The City of God XIX Augustine chronicles the woes of temporal human existence, and the impossibility of finding peace, our final end, during our life on earth. It is thus in some sense reasonable for us to turn humbly to faith in God as our only hope for salvation. This turning, or conversion, requires an act of willed submission to God. Only after this can the intellect know, by faith, the true character of our final end, and thus only after such willing can practical reason become truly informed as to how to act. The need for conversion brings one more un-Aristotelian idea into the picture, that of obedience to divine law.

c.  Intellectualism and Voluntarism

Aristotle’s account of practical reason could be characterized as intellectualist, not   because he ignores the very important role of desire, but because reason plays the leading role, and desire is naturally inclined to follow reason (“desire is consequent upon opinion … for the thinking is the starting point”). Further, although Aristotle employs the concept of rational wish, there is serious debate as to whether this can rightly be identified with what the medievals, following Augustine, call the will. By contrast, Augustine may be termed a voluntarist, not because reason is unimportant, but because with him it is the will that plays the primary role. As we have seen, even in the absence of passion, the will may choose contrary to the judgment of the intellect, and it is only by willed humility that we can come to know our true final end by faith.

Throughout much of the Christian Middle Ages, Augustine’s influence predominates. And although much important work was done on topics highly relevant to practical reasoning—for example, passages in Peter Lombard’s Sentences, and the work of  St. Anselm on the will and of Abelard on ethics—practical reasoning itself was not generally treated in a rigorous and systematic way. But in the twelfth century, translations of Aristotle’s works, together with Muslim and Jewish commentaries, began to flow into Western Europe, and to gain in influence, eventually rivaling or surpassing the importance of Augustine’s thought. These thinkers do treat practical reasoning in rigorous fashion, and under their influence, so too do the great thinkers of the High Middle Ages. In doing so, all draw on both Aristotle and Augustine, and although it is common practice to identify some as “Aristotelians” and “intellectualists,” and others as “Augustinians” and “voluntarists,” this does run the risk of oversimplifying. The reader should keep in mind that there is no one account of the relation between intellect and will that all intellectualists held, nor one opposed account that all voluntarists held. Instead, scholars sort thinkers according to whether they hold certain characteristic theses concerning such questions as these: Is the intellect or the will the higher power? Is the will a passive power (a “moved mover”) or an active one (a “self-mover”)? What sort of cause does the intellect exert on the will’s choice—does it specify the act of will, or can the will act independently and control its own choices (and can it act contrary to judgment)? A metaphor commonly used by those now classified as voluntarists was that of the Lord and the Lampbearer: The will is the lord, deciding where to go; the intellect contributes to the decision,  but in the same manner as the servant who lights the way (or rather the possible ways) with a lamp (see for example Henry of Ghent, Quodlibet Iq14). Intellectualists, by contrast, would see the intellect as the lord, and the will as the lieutenant or executive officer.

In the intellectualist camp we can probably include St. Albert (see the first McCluskey entry for a discussion) and John of Paris;  in the voluntarist camp, St. Bonaventure and Henry of Ghent. Others, such as Giles of Rome, occupy a position in the disputed middle ground (see Kent for an intellectualist reading of Giles; Eardley for a moderately voluntarist reading). The following sections will focus on the two figures who are arguably the most important and influential thinkers of the High Middle Ages, taking Aquinas as a representative of intellectualism, and Scotus as a representative of voluntarism. But it should be kept in mind that Aquinas treats Augustine as an authority and has a much more robust conception of the will than does Aristotle, and likewise that Scotus draws heavily upon Aristotle and insists upon a very important role for the intellect.

2.  Intellectualist Theory: Aquinas

Like both Aristotle and Augustine, St. Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274) is a eudaimonist; like Augustine he takes seriously both obedience to divine law and the role of the will in the genesis of action; yet like Aristotle he is an intellectualist. (This is generally accepted, but it should be noted that some scholars have argued for more somewhat more voluntarist readings of Aquinas than that offered below. See Eardley and Westberg for sources, discussion, and criticism of these interpretations.) For Aquinas, practical reasoning plays out in a dynamic exchange between intellect and will, an exchange in which intellect always has the first word (reason being the first principle of human action), but in which the will plays a key role and the agent remains free.

a.  The Interaction of Intellect and Will in Generating Action

For Aquinas, the will tends naturally toward the good, but to act it must have the good presented to it by reason in its practical capacity. Further, after apprehending and willing the good, the agent must decide whether and how to pursue it, which involves a process of collaboration between intellect and will. Let us begin with an example, making use of Ralph McInerny’s immortal character, Fifi LaRue. In the midst of a bad day, Fifi sees a travel poster advertising a Roman holiday, apprehends “how nice that would be,” and forms a wish to go. She considers the idea as befitting, and enjoys it. Nothing seems to stand in the way; the trip would be delightful and cause no problems; she forms the intention to go. But she must take counsel as to how she could accomplish it. Due to time constraints, she must fly, but could take a bus or taxi to the airport; she consents to both. Yet the bus would be so crowded … let it be the taxi then, she judges, and so chooses. Here is a taxi; she must hail it by raising her arm. So she commands, and so uses her arm. The taxi pulls up, and off she goes.

This example involves the steps and terms Aquinas spells out in questions 8-17 of the prima secundae (the first part of the second part of the Summa theologiae),  and we should now look at some of the details of this complex discussion: The intellect apprehends something as good and thereby presents it to the will, which then wills or wishes that good as an end—call this simple willing. (Strictly speaking, it would be more proper to say the agent apprehends the good by means of her intellect and simply wills it by means of her will; this is always what Aquinas means, although for convenience he often speaks of the intellect apprehending and so forth.) This does not yet mean that the agent pursues the good; she may decide not to for a variety of reasons—perhaps it is pleasant but sinful, and she immediately rejects it—or may be as yet undecided. She may then continue to consider the good, apprehend it as befitting in some ways, and, in a second act of will regarding the possible end, enjoy it (while we perfectly enjoy only an end possessed, we may imperfectly enjoy or entertain the idea of possessing it). Again, actual pursuit need not follow—perhaps the good is befitting but not currently feasible (Fifi, perhaps, lacks the money). Finally, the agent may actually undertake to pursue this good as an end, to tend toward it, and this act of will Aquinas calls intention (and here again, Aquinas is explicit that an act of reason precedes this act of will; cf. q12a1ad3).

Now intending the good as an end, the agent must determine how best to pursue it—she must decide upon means to the end. When the means are not immediately obvious, the agent deliberates or takes counsel, in which reason seeks out acceptable ways to the end; such ways being found the will then consents to them. Reason must then issue a judgment (q14a1) as to which is preferable, followed by the act of will called choice (q13, q15a3ad3). So, Fifi took counsel as to how to reach the airport, identifies and accepts two ways (bus or taxi), then judges the taxi superior and so chooses that means. But in considering how to get from America to Rome, she is able to skip the counsel/consent stage because the means (flying) are immediately obvious (she has no time for sailing).

The choice having been made, it is time to execute. Here again we see the same pattern of an act of intellect, command, followed by an act of will, use, whereby the will employs faculties of the soul, parts of the body, or material objects to make the choice effective. So when the taxi draws near, Fifi sees that she must wave, and commands “this (waving) is to be done.”  This command informs, or gives exact shape to, her already present will to take a taxi (her choice). Her will then uses her arm, puts it in motion.

Now the process described is a complex one, having as many as twelve steps from the initial apprehension of a good down to use. Do we really go through all of this? Aquinas does not mean that we consciously rehearse all the steps every time we perform an action (just as we do not consciously rehearse rules of grammar in articulating a thought). The twelve-step process is a logical reconstruction of the role of intellect and will in generating action. The steps are those we could consciously rehearse, and perhaps sometimes do (if facing a complicated matter, say, or if doggedly pressed for an explanation or justification of a past action). Usually, our actual practical reasoning will be much more concise. Daniel Westberg and others have argued that we should understand Aquinas to have in mind a streamlined version of the process centered around intention (apprehension and intention), decision (judgment and choice), and execution (command and use), with intellect and will working in unison at each stage. Other acts mentioned by Aquinas, such as counsel and consent, may serve auxiliary roles in complex situations.

Westberg stresses that we should not take Aquinas to mean that at each stage intellect renders its judgment and then the will decides whether or not to follow it—as we will see, this is the way of the voluntarists. Instead, the will naturally tends toward the good presented to it by the intellect at each stage. So for example in discussing whether choice is an act of intellect or of will, Aquinas says choice “is materially an act of the will, but formally an act of the reason” (q13a1)—roughly, the intellect in presenting some particular thing or action as good “forms” or makes specific the will’s general tendency toward the good (Aquinas follows Aristotle in maintaining that, like substances, accidents, including actions, can be analyzed in terms of form and matter). It is because the act of choice is completed by the will (judgment alone is not yet choice) that Aquinas is prepared to call it an act of will. Yet there is a real sense in which the stage Westberg calls “decision” comprises one act of the reasoning agent, an act whose form derives from reason and whose matter is supplied by will.

Voluntarists will charge that here the intellect is determining the will, which is thus not free. Now Aquinas calls that free which “retains the power of being inclined to various things” (Iaq83a1); a subject is free if it has this power. A rock is not free just because it can be inclined to heat or chill by the external power of fire or ice. Aquinas’s implied response to the voluntarist charge in the course of his discussion of choice is that the act of choice is free because the judgment that forms it is free, and the judgment is free because in considering any particular good, reason can focus on how it is good or on how it is lacking in goodness, leading to a judgment for or against it (q13a6). Worth noting, too, is that the will (and those other affective powers, the passions) play a role in attracting or diverting the attention of reason during the counsel it takes prior to judgment. But Aquinas’s more complete response would be that, strictly, it is not the will or reason that is free; the person is free in making the judgment and thus in making the choice the judgment informs. The intellect does not make the judgment, the person—the willing and feeling, as well as thinking, person—makes it by means of his intellect. The person is the subject that “retains the power” of, say, sitting closer to or further from the fire and thus being hot or cold; he exercises this power by means of his faculties of reason and will.

All of this shows how things can in many ways be more complicated, and less mechanical, than the initial description of Fifi’s pursuit of a Roman holiday suggested. One especially important factor, just touched on, is the reflexivity of both intellect and will. The will, for example, uses both intellect and itself throughout the process of deliberation (see q16a4c&ad3). In reaching her judgment, Fifi focused on the bus being crowded, but if her affections were more attuned to saving money, she might have focused instead on its economy. Further, she could at any point consider whether she should deliberate further and decide whether or not to do so. There is a potentially infinite regress here, but not an actual one. In taking counsel, having consented to taking the bus, she could yield to impatience and hop on the bus she sees rather than thinking further and realizing that a taxi would be better. Neither the bus nor the taxi, nor for that matter any other means or particular good in this life, is a perfect good. Thus none of them determine reason in its favor. Our judgment, and thus our choice, remain free. This highlights one reason Aquinas can be called an intellectualist, namely that he identifies reason as the source of freedom (see Iaq59a3: “wherever there is intellect, there is free-will”). But again, if this seems, paradoxically, to locate freedom in reason rather than will, it is well to remember that Aquinas’s talk of the intellect doing this, and the will that, is all shorthand for the person acting by means of each faculty. It is the person, not her faculties, who judges and chooses; and does both freely.

b.  The Practical Syllogism

But how does such reasoning relate to the Aristotelian notion of the practical syllogism Aquinas adopts? The intellectual acts regarding, and the pursuant intention of, the end supply the major premise (say, “I should go to Rome.”). The minor premise is supplied by deliberation, resulting in judgment and choice (“Taking a cab to the airport is the best way to Rome.”). This may take a major premise-minor premise form as above, but often the deliberation of the agent would be better represented as a longer argument with several premises, or as an iterated series of two-premise arguments finally reaching down to the concrete action. In this case, the means to the end initially chosen would then become the object of intention as a proximate end (q12a2), and counsel would be taken as to the means to that end, and so forth, until something that can be done here and now is reached (much as we saw above in the discussion of Aristotle).

Two questions present themselves at this point: What sort of reasoning goes into the formation of intentions, and how is this reasoning, and the reasoning involved in counsel, done well or ill? Sketching an answer to these questions requires a discussion of happiness, law, and virtue.

c.  Happiness, Law, and Virtue

Aquinas agrees with Aristotle that we have a final end, and with Augustine that it is not to be attained in this life (it is not a Roman holiday, unless perhaps in a very metaphorical sense). Using the term "happiness” is a potentially misleading, but common, translation of beatitude. Blessedness or flourishing would be better, for in fact our final end is our completion or perfection. Aquinas takes it that we all agree, or would agree upon reflection, on that. There is neither need nor room for practical reasoning about it. Yet we disagree over that in which it consists: one says wealth, another power, another (Fifi, perhaps) pleasure. And here we can reason: The mere fact that Aquinas wrote the first five questions of the prima secundae shows that he thought so. There he argues that because the will wills the good universally, and only God is universally good, our final end is attained in virtuous activity culminating in the right relation to God (although we may not know that the happiness we seek can be found only in and with God), which consists principally in loving contemplation and secondarily in obedient service. Only this perfects our nature as rational creatures. Although Aquinas agrees with Augustine that this end can be attained, or even adequately understood, only by God’s grace, Aquinas takes it that we do tend naturally (even if inadequately) toward it, and that its attainment fulfills, as well as transcends, our nature (“Grace does not destroy nature but perfects it” Iaq1a8ad2). What reason is able to make out about our final end, then, is reliable and authoritative, even if always incomplete.

There is a long-standing controversy in Aquinas scholarship concerning the relationship between what Aquinas calls imperfect and perfect beatitude: Do we have a natural final end of humanly virtuous activity and a distinct supernatural final end of contemplation of and friendship with God? Or do we have just one final end that is naturally unattainable? Here readers are referred to Bradley for a very thorough discussion of the issues involved.

Because by our nature we have a final end, any other end we have (going to Rome, perhaps) could be reconsidered in its light, and since everything we do is (perhaps unconsciously) done for the sake of the final end (Ia-IIaeq1a6), every other good we pursue, though seen as an end, is also a means to our final end, and under this aspect can be deliberated about, evaluated, and judged appropriate or not. In this sense, ends too are objects of counsel and judgment (q14a2). Fifi might adopt the end of going to Rome capriciously, but she might also stand back and take counsel about it under its aspect of a means to her conception of her final end. That is the sort of reasoning that can go into the formation of intentions. To see how Aquinas thinks such reasoning, as well as the reasoning about means, should be done, we must look at how his discussion of the final end relates to his discussion of the natural law.

As natural creatures, we have a natural inclination (in fact, an ordered set of natural inclinations) toward our perfection as human beings. As rational creatures, we can understand and endorse these inclinations, and articulate them into principles of practical reason, which are at the same time precepts of the natural law. How so? As Pamela Hall and Jean Porter have argued, the process of articulation involves a reflective, and developing, grasp of human nature and its tendencies, including an understanding of it and them as good. This understanding is ultimately founded on the recognition that human nature is created and directed by God, Goodness itself (this recognition can be achieved, however imperfectly, by means of natural knowledge of God). This allows the articulated principles to meet the criteria of law (q90a4): They are ordinances of reason (our own, and ultimately God’s) for the common good (due to our social nature), made by Him who has care of the community (again, God), and promulgated (they are made known, or knowable, to us through our natural inclinations). So although the precepts of the natural law ultimately derive their authority from God, they can be known independently of any knowledge of God—as Bradley puts it, they are “metaphysically theonomous” but “logically autonomous”)—and knowledge of them certainly does not require revelation.

Briefly setting out the inclinations and some of the precepts should illustrate this process of articulation, and at the same time give some indication of how it is connected with our pursuit of our final end. Like all things, we are naturally inclined toward our own good or perfection (good is that which all things seek), and thus as being is the first thing apprehended by reason simply, good is the first thing apprehended by reason as practical, or as directed toward action. And Aquinas takes it that, just as a grasp of the meaning of being and non-being leads naturally to knowledge of the principle of noncontradiction, so a grasp of good and evil leads to knowledge of the first principle of practical reason, good is to be done and pursued, and evil avoided: “All other precepts of the natural law are based upon this: so that whatever the practical reason naturally apprehends as man's good (or evil) belongs to the precepts of the natural law as something to be done or avoided” (q94a2). And what do we naturally apprehend as good? Those things toward which we are naturally inclined, for good is an end and these are our ends by nature. Aquinas identifies three levels of these inclinations: That common to all substances (the inclination to continue to exist), that shared with other animals (inclinations to reproduce and to educate one’s offspring), and that proper to rational beings (to know the truth, ultimately about God, and to live in society). Phrases such as “and so forth” and “and other such things” occur in this passage, indicating that this is a quick overview rather than an exhaustive statement of the content of the natural law.

How are these inclinations articulated into precepts? This question might take the form of a procedural question concerning how we might move from an inclination to a norm (a version of the concern about moving from is to ought); this is addressed above (the inclinations are directives given by eternal reason—the natural law is a participation in the eternal law in the sense that our natural inclinations have their origin in God’s plan and creative action (q91a2)). But it might also take the substantive form of asking how we move from the inclinations mentioned to particular norms, and this needs to be explained. As we saw, Aquinas holds that as soon as we understand the meaning of the terms “good” and “evil,” we naturally understand that good is to be done and pursued and evil avoided—we have this knowledge by a “natural habit” he calls synderesis, (see q94a1ad2 and Iaq79a12). We know other things in this way too: That we are to fulfill our special obligations to others, and to do evil to no one—these are elucidations of the first principle, and from them flow a number of other principles, which have also been revealed to us in the Decalogue (see Ia-IIaeq100): The command to honor one’s parents functions as a paradigm for honoring one’s indebtedness in general; the commands forbidding murder, adultery, and theft speak to refraining from doing evil to others by deed; the commands forbidding false witness and coveting speak to refraining from doing evil by word or thought.

Aquinas is not as explicit as we might wish about how we acquire this knowledge, and there is some dispute here among commentators. One question is, must we acquire it at all? Does not Aquinas say that the principles grasped by synderesis are self-evident (if that is a good translation of per se nota)? The answer is that, yes, we must acquire it, for there is no innate knowledge; synderesis is a habit and so must be acquired. We do acquire it naturally, in this sense, that once we come to understand the terms employed in the principles, the principles are naturally known to be true. Experience and reflection are needed to grasp the meaning of such terms as good and evil, the proper objects of special obligations, the scope of non-maleficence. In this process our natural inclinations play a role: life, family, social life, and knowledge are good for each, and our social nature further directs us to attend to the common good and the good of our neighbor as well as our own private good. We might sketch the process as follows (although Aquinas never puts it quite this way): Good is to be done and evil avoided. So first, since good is to be done, and special obligations indicate goods owed to others, they are to be fulfilled. Second, since evil is to be avoided, it is to be done to no one (our social inclination here coming into play); we are naturally inclined to life, family, and society, so obtaining these things is good for each and losing them evil; thus murder, adultery, and so forth are evil and so not to be done.

In any event, once we have such principles in hand, as Aquinas takes it we all do, we have also in hand a way of evaluating whether we should allow our simple willings (such as, “how nice a Roman holiday would be”) to pass into intention—would it be good or evil to go now to Rome—is it consistent or otherwise with my flourishing as a rational creature? Would it for example violate any special obligation I am under, or perhaps require stealing? As said above, any proximate end an agent is considering whether to adopt may also be seen as a means to the agent’s final end, and its suitability as such may be judged by its accord with precepts of the natural law—these should serve, we may say, as penultimate major premises, under the first principle of practical reason, of any practical syllogism (or, when stated negatively, as a “filter” for all prospective means or proximate ends).

There is one major piece of the puzzle we have yet to deal with, the role of virtue in all of this. First, how exactly do these three, blessedness, law, and virtue, fit together? As indicated above, the natural law is a participation in the eternal law that resides primarily in our natural inclinations: the rational creature “has a share of the Eternal Reason, whereby it has a natural inclination to its proper act and end: and this participation of the eternal law in the rational creature is called the natural law” (q91a2). Our natural inclinations direct us toward our proper end, that is to say toward beatitudo, and the attainment of it is the fulfillment of our inclinations. But as we have also seen, our blessedness consists in virtuous activity (culminating in the loving contemplation of God). Such being the case, we should expect the natural law to direct us toward virtuous activity, and Aquinas does say explicitly that the natural law prescribes virtuous activity (q94a3, and see Pinckaers for an interesting development of the idea that the natural inclinations are the “seeds of the virtues,” into which they grow through the work of reason and habituation). So natural law, through informing our natural inclinations, provides the direction toward our final end, through the virtues as (constitutive) means to it.

Second, how does virtue play this role? We move toward our end through free, reasoned action, and cannot simply decide to grasp our final end. We must make a series of choices and carry them out, and it is here that virtue plays its principal role. One thing we clearly must do is reason well about how to act; we require excellence in practical reasoning. And that is to say we require prudence, which just is the virtue that applies right reason to action. But we also require the moral virtues such as justice and fortitude, which enable our knowledge of both the ends and means in practical reasoning. Aquinas is clear, as Aristotle was not, that we naturally know the ends we should pursue (this is the role of synderesis; see above, and also IIa-IIaeq47a6), but he also insists that we are rightly disposed toward that end by the moral virtues (Ia-IIaeq65a1)—the moral virtues safeguard us from “forgetting” our ends under the influence of vice, custom, or passion (q94a6)—fortitude, for instance, helps us control our fear of dangers so as to remain committed to the common good. The virtues also enable us to find the right means to the end. This is properly the work of prudence. Looking at how prudence does this work will clarify how the moral virtues play a supporting role in it. Aquinas says prudence has eight “quasi-integral parts” which can be classified as follows: Those that supply knowledge (memory and understanding or an intuitive grasp of the salient features of the present situation), those that acquire knowledge (docility and shrewdness), that which uses knowledge (reasoning, constructing the practical syllogism), and those that apply knowledge in command, the chief act of prudence (foresight directs present actions to the foreseen end, circumspection adjusts means to circumstances, and caution avoids obstacles to realizing the end). Prudence depends on the moral virtues not just to safeguard reason’s grasp of principles, but throughout its reasoning toward action. The parts of prudence just enumerated should make this clear: Docility, for example, requires humility. Also, the identification of the correct means to an intended end involves the understanding, or intuitive grasp, of the situation that helps supply the minor premise in a practical syllogism (see IIa-IIaeq49a2ad1). But this understanding can be corrupted by the intrusion of passion, as in cases of incontinence (Ia-IIaeq77a2), a state to which all are subject, unless fortified by the moral virtues (Fifi’s hopping impatiently on the bus although a cab would have been better presents a very mild case of such incontinence).

d.  Final Comments

So for Aquinas practical reason is our capacity to discover how to move from our present situation toward the attainment of our final end. In successful practical reasoning, synderesis, prudence, and moral virtue work together to ensure that the action meets all of the criteria of a good action (q18aa1-4): suitability of object (what kind of action is this, borrowing or stealing?), due attention to circumstances (might frankness here and now be unduly embarrassing to one’s interlocutor?), and goodness of the end of action (is my goal in giving alms to impress a potential benefactor, or to succor the need of the less fortunate; ultimately, the end is good if and only if it is conducive to the agent’s final end). While practical reasoning presupposes our understanding of our final end as perfection, everything else in our practical lives, including our conception of our final end and to what extent we honor the principles grasped by synderesis, lies within its scope. When practical reasoning is done well leading to good action, the agent at one and the same time pursues her own perfection (the Aristotelian moment) and obeys the eternal law of God (the Augustinian)—the etymological connection between prudence and providence mirrors a metaphysical connection, for our practical reason participates in the eternal reason (q91a2; see also q19a10). Since our perfection is perfection as creatures, there is no tension between it and obedience—for Aquinas, practical reason is not torn between the fulfillment of obligation and the fulfillment of the agent.

3.  Voluntarist Theory: Scotus

The reception of Aristotle and other non-Christian thinkers was never entirely easy, and worries about the influence of Greek and Arabic thought culminated, just after Aquinas’s death, in the Condemnations of 1277. In publishing them, the Bishop of Paris condemned 219 propositions drawn chiefly from Aristotle and his commentators, and while the principal target of these condemnations was the teaching of a “radical Aristotelianism” (or “Latin Averroism”) contrary to the Catholic faith by masters on the Faculty of Arts such as Siger of Brabant, a number of the condemned propositions were drawn from Aquinas’s work, although Aquinas was not named. In their wake the marriage between Greek and Biblical thought, between Aristotle and Augustine we might say, is a stormier one. Among the chief concerns of the Condemnations were divine and human freedom, and later thinkers were especially concerned to safeguard both. Many of them, rejecting Aquinas’s account of human freedom, found it necessary to portray the will itself as free. One way they did this was to stress the will’s independence from determination by nature, including the natural power of the intellect and the second nature imparted by virtues. The will was seen as free rather than as natural, and as nobler than the intellect—thus these thinkers are often called voluntarists.

John Duns Scotus (c. 1266-1308) is the most impressive and influential of the post-1277 thinkers, and his sharp break with eudaimonism in many ways anticipates modern moral theory, especially that of Kant. It should be noted, though, that even in making this break Scotus is working within the medieval tradition, drawing here especially on St. Anselm’s work On the Fall of the Devil;   Scotus is also indebted to his Franciscan predecessors and fellow-travelers such as Henry of Ghent. The following presents some of the main lines of his account of practical reason, but readers should be aware that there are currently some major disputes over how to interpret Scotus; some of these will be mentioned, but readers are invited to consult the secondary sources mentioned for further information.

a.  Freedom of the Will

Scotus emphasizes the freedom of the will in three key ways. The first two are rooted in his (characteristically voluntarist) teaching that the will is a self-mover rather than moved by anything else (an active rather than passive power); the third helps explain this capacity for self-movement. The first, then, lies in his emphasis on the dominance of the will over other powers, including the intellect. Just as in seeing we can focus on an object not in the center of our visual field, so in intellection the will can focus on and enjoy something other than what the intellect directly presents, and thus redirect the intellect (Opus Oxoniense II, dist. 42, qq1-4, nn. 10-11). The moral importance of this is that the will can turn aside from what the intellect presents as good and pursue something else (although   that something else must be good in some respect). Second, he insists that in addition to being able to will or “nil” (velle or nolle), the will always retains the option simply to refrain from willing (non velle). This is important, for Scotus takes it that if we necessarily will something, we are not free. Scotus allows that the will is unable to nil beatitude, but holds that it can refrain from willing it, and so remains free (Ordinatio IV, suppl., dist. 49, qq9-10). This points up an important difference between his account and that of an intellectualist like Aquinas, who maintains that when the intellect has perfect vision of a perfect good (as it does only in the beatific vision), the intellect sees it as good, and the will adheres to that good, both from natural necessity. Scotus denies the necessity of willing the good presented by the intellect even here. The third point concerns his adoption of Anselm’s notion of the two affections of the will (which itself draws on Augustine’s account of the two loves of the will). The will’s tendency toward the agent’s perfection is called the affectio commodi, the natural appetite of the will that prohibits us from nilling perfection. It is similar to the will, simply, as it is understood by eudaimonist thinkers like Aquinas. See (Williams 1995) for an argument that it is identical to the will so understood; see (Toner 2005) for an argument that it is not. But it does not exhaust the will for Scotus, nor does it necessitate the willing of happiness, due to the affectio iustitiae, the tendency of the will to love things in accordance with their goodness, and not simply as means to or constituents of our own happiness. It is this affection, for Scotus, that grants the will its “native liberty.”

It also renders his account of practical reason more complicated, for now we see two distinct ways in which reason can present something as good to the will: First, something may be judged to be conducive to our happiness or perfection as rational agents (attracting the affectio commodi); second, something may be judged to be morally good or right or just (appealing to the affectio iustitiae). Thus, we can reason about how to attain happiness, or how to act justly. And although these will come together in our final union with God, they are always formally distinct and will often pull apart in this life. There is a hint here of what Sidgwick would much later call a dualism of practical reason, a dualism which in various forms characterizes most modern moral systems, Kantian or utilitarian.  Scotus’ response to this situation also anticipates modern moral thinking (see Toner on this)—the pursuit of happiness must be moderated by justice; as Scotus puts it, the affection for justice acts as a “checkrein” (moderatrix) on the affection for happiness (Ordinatio II, dist. 6, q2). If the pursuit is not so moderated, it will be bad or at best morally indifferent. A crucial, and characteristically voluntarist, implication follows: Once the intellect has judged an act to be good (in either broad sense), the will remains free to follow the judgment or not, according to which affection it acts on. It may refuse to pursue a good conducive to happiness because doing so conflicts with a requirement of justice; it may turn from a good required by justice in order to pursue happiness instead (in the Ordinatio passage just cited, Scotus accounts for the sin of the angels along these lines). For better or worse, depending upon what one takes freedom to involve, Aquinas’s moderately intellectualist view that reason and will concur in free choice has been replaced by the voluntarist view that once reason has done its work, the will must independently make its free choice.

Here we touch on a controversial area. None of the voluntarists held that reason could be dispensed with, or was unimportant. At the least, reason must present options (and recommendations) to the will for it to be able to choose. Henry of Ghent had maintained that this was the extent of reason’s contribution to free choice (that it was merely a causa sine qua non—a necessary pre-condition of willing, but not properly a cause of it). Scotus at one point held a more moderate view, that reason served as a partial efficient cause of willing. Some Scotus scholars argue that he later moved further in the voluntarist direction, coming to accept something close to Henry’s view (or at least acknowledging it as an account just as persuasive as his own earlier view; see (Dumont 2001) for a detailed discussion). Whatever the correct view of  Scotus’ mature position, however, the point about the will’s independence from reason should not be taken to be a denial of reason’s important role leading up to choice.

It would be an even greater mistake to think that, because Scotus is a voluntarist, he downplays reason’s contribution to choosing morally good actions. In fact, Scotus insists as firmly as Aquinas that to be morally good, an action must be willed in accordance with right reason (Quodlibet, q18). What does this involve for Scotus?

b.  Synderesis, Conscience, and the Natural Law

Scotus follows tradition in invoking the notions of synderesis and conscience (Ordinatio II, dist. 39): Conscience is the habit of drawing the right conclusions about what is to be done by means of the practical syllogism. As such it depends upon knowledge of the first principles of practical reason, and synderesis is the habit of knowing these. What are they? Like Aquinas, Scotus takes them to be precepts of the natural law, but his handling of these precepts is quite different. His treatment of natural law makes no reference to natural inclinations—instead of being articulations of the directedness of human nature, the precepts are rules that are self-evident to reason because their denials lead to contradictions. For example, since good is the object of love and God is infinite goodness itself, the first principle of practical reason is that God is to be loved or, most strictly, God is not to be hated (Ordinatio III, suppl., dist. 37), for “goodness itself is to be hated” is self-contradictory. Scotus also relates the natural law to the Decalogue, and holds that from this first principle we may conclude that the precepts of the First Table (relating to God) follow and belong to the natural law strictly speaking. The precepts of the Second Table (relating to neighbor), however, belong to the natural law only broadly speaking—they are consonant with the principles known to be true analytically, but do not follow from them necessarily. In this passage, Scotus also distinguishes the precepts of the First and Second Tables, the precepts that belong to the natural law strictly and only broadly speaking, as follows: It is, in the abstract, possible for us to attain our final end of loving God without following the precepts of the Second Table (although not in the concrete, given that God actually has issued these commands), but is absolutely impossible for us to attain it while disobeying the precepts of the First. Thus, practical reason by itself is sufficient to tell us that if God exists, we must not hate Him, must have no other gods before Him. Scotus does not think we are left with theoretical possibilities and unaided practical reason—we know from Revelation that God has ordained the precepts of the Second Table, which are thus binding (for having been commanded, they move beyond being merely consonant with the love of God). Still, strictly speaking they are contingent and could be set aside or altered by God’s absolute power. Indeed Scotus thinks that in certain cases God has actually dispensed from them (see Ordinatio III, suppl., dist. 37; there is dispute among scholars as to how malleable the content of moral principles concerning love of neighbor is, and how open to rational investigation; see for example Wolter, Williams 1995, and Mohle’s contribution to Williams 2003).

To illustrate the relationship of consonance, Scotus gives us an example of the analogous relationship in positive law between “the principle of positive law,” that life in community should be peaceful, and secondary legal principles concerning private property. The institution of private property is not absolutely required to preserve peace, but given the infirmities of human nature, the common holding of property is likely to result in dispute and neglect. Thus allowing people to have their own possessions is “exceedingly consonant with peaceful living.” Likewise, although failing to love one’s neighbor is not strictly inconsistent with loving God (nor rejecting precepts stated in the Second Table strictly inconsistent with loving one’s neighbor), there is a harmony or consonance at both points (between love of God and neighbor, and between love of neighbor and honoring these precepts), for God has created us as social creatures and the precepts of the Second Table are conducive to social life. Although Scotus is not explicit, we may surmise that the principle that life in community ought to be peaceful belongs to the natural law in this broad sense, as peaceful life with God’s other rational creatures seems “exceedingly consonant” with love of God. As we will see, Scotus does explicitly say elsewhere that the “Silver Rule” belongs to the law of nature (broadly speaking). Prohibitions against murder, adultery, false witness and so forth follow from these pretty clearly, by way of consonance if not strict logical necessity.

So right practical reason begins from the precepts of the natural law, but how does it move to the judgment of conscience? Let us look at a case of deciding what to say when asked about one’s role in a certain affair, perhaps when lying might keep the agent out of some trouble. Scotus takes it that reason can grasp the wrongness of lying on the following basis: The Silver Rule, “Do not do to others what you would not want them to do to you,” is not only a commandment but a law of nature, at least in the broad sense; no one would want to be deceived by his neighbor; therefore, …. (Ordinatio III, suppl., dist. 38). With this principle in hand, how is one to act? It will depend on the particulars of the situation. The agent should now know that he should not deceive, but should tell the truth (or perhaps remain silent, if, say, the person asking is a gossip with no real stake in the matter; let us assume such is not the case). This much is clear from reason’s grasp of the principle and its understanding of the agent himself as a rational being, the action as speaking to another rational being, and the object as telling the truth (Scotus gives an example with the agent under the description of (rational) animal, the action as eating, and the object as nourishing food; Quodlibet, q18). But practical reason still has work to do: It must discern the right manner in which to tell the truth (say, calmly and straightforwardly rather than aggressively or evasively), and the right time and place (later in private, rather than now in company, say). Most importantly, it must place the act in service of a “worthy purpose,” direct it to an appropriate end (one that is just rather than merely advantageous—for acts that proceed solely from the affectio commodi will not be fully in accordance with right reason, since they focus only on the value of their objects to the agent, ignoring what intrinsic value they may have—thus Scotus holds that they are at best morally indifferent).

c.  The Non-Teleological Character of Scotus’ Thought

Much of the detail above is similar to what Aquinas says about the moral goodness of action, which should not be surprising because both are drawing on Aristotle and Christian tradition, but there is an important difference as to the goodness of the ends of particular actions. Aquinas takes it that in intending, the will (and its proximate ends) should be ordered to the final end or highest good. This final end is the perfection of the agent, which itself consists in the right relation to God. In principle, the agent could articulate this ordering as a series of syllogisms in which practical reason clarified the way the pursuit of this proximate end is linked to the pursuit of the agent’s final end as set by her nature as a rational creature. A metaphorical way of putting this: Actions can be seen as episodes in a story that the agent, by means of her practical reason, is writing (or co-authoring, given God’s providential role). In the well-written story (the practically rational life blessed by grace), the episodes successfully lead up to the happy ending, in which the agent is united with her true love and, quite literally, lives happily ever after.

For Scotus, this teleological character largely (though not entirely) disappears. Actions must still be related to God, whom Scotus is happy to refer to as our final end. But now God in a way serves less as final end than as first cause, in the sense of author of the moral law or of dispensations from it; God is not so much sought after as an end, as honored and obeyed as source. At least in those actions that have creatures as their object (that is, most actions we perform in this life)—and which are therefore only contingently related to our attainment of God as our final end—practical reason does not identify the right way to act by discerning how the prospective actions contribute to a series leading up to the right relation to God (it does not construct a series of syllogisms in the way just mentioned). Instead, each prospective action is judged separately, as to whether it honors God appropriately, expresses love of God and obeys His commands (although such thoughts need not be always present in the agent’s mind). Actions may still be teleologically ordered, for a number of actions may be ordered to the accomplishment of a moral end. But it is no longer the case that all actions and their ends must be organized into a pattern or narrative completed only in the agent’s attainment of her final end, and that they can be fully assessed only in light of their place in such a pattern. Instead, each action (or course of action) stands alone as a complete work, and the ends of actions may be judged in light of their fit with the situation and their accord or discord with precepts of the natural law or other authoritative source (revealed commands, a divine dispensation). Picking up the author metaphor again, life is not so much a novel as a collection of epigrams and short stories, dedicated with love to God. This deep difference between Aquinas and Scotus is reflected in—indeed is a consequence of—their different formulations of the first principle of practical reason: “Good is to be done and pursued, and evil avoided” (Aquinas); “God is to be loved, and never hated” (Scotus). The one focuses on pursuit of the good (relationship with God); the other on the expression of love for God.

Related to this is  Scotus’ reduced role for the moral virtues: He holds that prudence can exist without moral virtue, that as free we always have what we need to do the right action here and now; it need not be part of a larger pattern involving the development of character (Ordinatio III, suppl., dist. 36). Yet, Scotus has no wish to deny that the virtues are important: they can help turn the will from evil (the willing of which can blind the intellect to the truth by turning it away for a time), can help facilitate the will’s choosing in accordance with the right judgment of prudence, and can also help the act to be done in the right manner. Moral virtue assists us, then, both in reasoning about action and in making that reasoning effectively practical, but it is not essential to performing morally good actions.

d.  Note on Ockham

Now it is perhaps these non-teleological aspects of  Scotus’ thought, more than any other, that mark him out as a transitional figure. It is thus worth noting that it is concerning this feature of his thought that some of the disputes mentioned above are taking place. Williams (1995) and MacIntyre (1990) stress the role of obligation and divine commands in his theory; Hare and Ingham stress instead the role of love and the goal of relationship with God—views perhaps susceptible of some kind of teleological interpretation after all. However in the end Scotus should be read on this, it does seem fair to say, at the least, that divine commands, and the related notions of obligation and obedience, play a more prominent role in his thinking than they do in that of Aquinas.

And in any event, the later Franciscan William of Ockham will leave little doubt that he is a divine command theorist (but, see Osborne and the noted selections in Spade for a recent exchange on this). This does not mean that he is not concerned with practical reason; he still insists that the morally good action is the one dictated by right reason and willed because so dictated (Quodlibet IIIq15). But practical reason now operates within the framework of God’s ordained power, wholly constructed by God’s sovereign will. Knowledge of what God’s power has actually ordained, and thus of how we should act, is now even more dependent upon revelation; God could, by his absolute power, command us even to hate him, and it would then be right for us to do so. Here we have moved from  Scotus’ moderate voluntarism to an extreme form in which morality consists in the obligation impressed by the commanding divine will upon the obedient (or otherwise) human will, and in which practical reason serves merely to help articulate what has been commanded and how to carry it out. The prevailing order, for Ockham, is one in which familiar concepts have application (prudence, the moral virtues, the Decalogue), but the radical contingency hanging about the whole is novel.

4.  Medieval and Modern

This section briefly examines the influence of these two theorists on contemporary practical reasoning theory, and also explores the relation between their views of practical reason and some common positions in current debates (those between Generalists and Particularists, and between Internalists and Externalists).

a.  The Current Influence of Aquinas and Scotus

The two figures focused on above are the two who seem most relevant to contemporary theorizing about practical reason. Aquinas’s influence is widespread: In Anglophonic moral philosophy Alasdair MacIntyre is perhaps the best-known among his many followers, developing Aquinas’s thought in ways more sensitive to the context of culture and tradition. Candace Vogler develops a broadly Thomistic theory of practical reason, exploring both his account of the capital vices and his division of the good into befitting, pleasurable, and useful (See (Toner 2005) for a short look at this division, and (Vogler 2002) for a very thorough treatment), concluding that in an atheistic context, it will be reasonable for some agents to be vicious. In general, the relevance of Aquinas’s thought as a development of Aristotle makes him a likely source for anyone working on practical reasoning or moral theory in this tradition, a fact not missed by some prominent moral theorists, most notably Philippa Foot and Rosalind Hursthouse. As for Scotus, his affinity with, and likely indirect influence upon, Kant, has been remarked by friends and foes alike (Williams and MacIntyre, for example). His direct influence on current thinking has not been great, but if the continuing progress on the critical edition of his works and the proliferation of Scotus scholarship are any indication, this may be beginning to change. In mainstream English philosophy, John Hare is perhaps the most prominent theorist so far to develop positions deeply indebted to Scotus.  Scotus’ combination within his moral theory of deontological and virtue elements should make his thinking of interest to Kantian or other deontological theorists intent on appropriating broadly Aristotelian notions of virtue. Also, his subtle treatment of the relations between reason, divine and human freedom, and the absolute and ordained powers of God, should make him of great interest to contemporary divine command theorists (Hare provides one example of this).

b. The Medievals and Particularism

Turning to the first of the current debates concerning practical reason: Let generalism be the view that the presence of some features of action (say that it causes pleasure, or is unkind) always tends to make the action right (or wrong)—such features have invariable “deontic valence.” This may come in forms “thin” (some natural features of action, say conduciveness to pleasure, always have a positive valence) or “thick” (while there are no such natural features, there are certain thick features, like kindness or fairness or spitefulness, that have invariable valence). Particularism, then, is the denial of this. We may speak of thin or thick forms particularism, being denials of the corresponding forms of generalism (one may, then, be at the same time a thick generalist and thin particularist). Where do the medievals fall along this spectrum? They tend toward thick generalism, indeed, we might say toward thick absolutism, a form of generalism maintaining that there are some features of action that not only tend to make an action right or wrong, but always succeed in doing so. For Aquinas, for example, the fact that any action was vicious, or violated any precept of the natural law, would make it wrong. This is thick rather than thin generalism because the precepts have evaluative content that cannot be reduced to merely “natural” or thin terms (for example, while the precept against murder is certainly not just the claim that “wrongful killing is wrong,” it is the claim that “intentional killing of the innocent is wrong,” and “innocence” cannot be reduced to thin, non-evaluative language). For Scotus, things look quite similar, within the framework of God’s ordained power. But because dispensations are possible by God’s absolute power, the features picked out by natural law precepts relevant to the Second Table are not of invariable valence (that Isaac was innocent may actually tend to make sacrificing him right, given God’s command to Abraham). Still, there are some absolutes for Scotus, those pertaining to the love of God in the First Table. Ockham comes the closest to particularism, leaving just one feature of actions that has invariably positive valence, its having been commanded by God. Ockham also maintains that, when possible, loving God above all things is always right, subtly reconciling this with his claim that God could command us not to love Him (on the grounds that given such a command it would be impossible to love Him above all things; see Quodlibet IIIq14).

c. The Medievals and Internalism

Let us turn to reasons for action and their connection to motivation. Internalism comes in many forms, but common to them is the claim that if an agent has a reason to do some action A, she also has a motive to A (the denial of this—the assertion that an agent may have a reason to A but have no motive to A—is called “externalism”). One characteristic form of internalism, often referred to as “Humean,” is the claim that if R is a reason for S to do A, then A must serve some desire that S actually has. The medievals were not internalists in this sense. A Thomistic agent, for example, has a reason to pursue a good perfective of him even if he has no desire for it at present. But, does not the agent have another desire the good serves, namely for perfection? Actually no. It is the will that naturally aims at what is perfective of the agent, and the will is a power, not a standing desire. But the will is naturally inclined to pursue such goods, so perhaps a modified internalism, that cited not just actual but also counterfactual desires (the agent would desire it if suitably informed and so forth)? Perhaps so, but details aside, there is one more critical qualification to make: Although internalism strictly requires only a connection between reason and motivation, it is usually also held that the latter has priority, that the explanatory direction is from desire to reason for action. For Aquinas, the direction is instead from reason to desire (the various acts of reason serving as the formal causes of the corresponding acts of will). Allowing for this, and given careful specifications of the counterfactual conditions, Aquinas and other intellectualists could probably be brought under some fold or other of the big tent of internalism.

For Scotus and other (sometimes more thoroughgoing) voluntarists, things are harder to see. The relation between intellect and will is looser, but still it is not held that the will’s desiring something can create a reason for the agent to act; instead, reason serves as a sort of necessary condition of the will’s act of desire (as mentioned above, perhaps a partial efficient cause as Scotus held at one point, perhaps as a causa sine qua non as Henry of Ghent held and—some argue—Scotus later held). If the will is the total cause of its own willing, or at least the primary cause, it can refrain from willing in accordance with the judgment presented by right practical reason (recall  Scotus’ point about non velle). Scotus even, following Anselm, performs a thought experiment concerning an angel created without the affectio iustitiae, maintaining that it could then only pursue its own happiness, and not what is intrinsically just. He does not explicitly say that it correctly identifies the right reasons for action, but given the independence of prudence from the moral virtues, it seems likely it could (“God is not to be hated” is, after all, supposed to be self-evidently true; and such an angel could understand the content of God’s revealed commands). If so, it could have reasons (not to hate God, not to commit or encourage lying or murder) with no corresponding desires (since it lacks the affectio iustitiae that would motivate it to follow these precepts even in cases in which doing so is not instrumental to its own happiness).

It is dangerous to sort philosophers according to distinctions they themselves do not have in mind (notice my hesitant language about Aquinas’s internalism above), but it seems that Scotus and other voluntarists would likely be externalists. This can be said more confidently—neither intellectualist nor voluntarist agents look much like the internalist and externalist agents one typically meets in the contemporary literature. But perhaps this is an advantage, for the medievals develop options largely ignored in much current discussion. And, it may be that the presence of more angels—falling, deformed, whole, and standing firm—would make for much livelier discussion.

5. Conclusion: Common Themes among the Medievals

So far this article has emphasized differences between the medieval accounts of practical reason, and their connections with some points in current theorizing. It is worth bringing out a few features that bring the medievals together while distinguishing them as a group from most current theorists. First, there is the shared Aristotelian and Augustinian heritage, already mentioned above. With this comes an agreement that our final end is the right relationship with God, a union with God by means of intellect and will. This is perfectly clear in intellectualists like Aquinas, but also holds for voluntarists. Scotus, for example, agrees that God is our final end; the initially open question is how to relate to Him: qua object of the affectio commodi (as the source of our perfection), or qua object of the affectio iustitiae (as perfect in Himself). And for all of the medievals, the good life consists in the successful attempt to achieve this union, to find, we might say, one’s proper place in Creation. In The City of God XIX.13, Augustine defines peace—our final end on his account—as the tranquillity of order, where order is the arrangement of things in which each finds its proper place in relation to the others, under God.

None of this is intended to paper over important differences, for example about just how to characterize that proper place, or whether the attempt to find it is best seen as a unified narrative or as a set of independent courses of action (whether life is a novel, we might say, or an anthology of short stories). It is intended only to stress the broad and important agreement underlying the differences in their accounts of practical reason. This is an agreement we should not find surprising given their shared belief, based on both philosophical argument and on faith, in a providential Creator, who is both Reason and Goodness. And it is an agreement whose importance we can recognize when we note that no medieval ever held that right practical reason could recommend an immoral course of action as, if Vogler is right, it can often do in an atheistic context.

6. References and Further Reason

a. Primary Sources

  • Anselm, On the Fall of the Devil, translated by Ralph McInerny in Anselm of Canterbury: The Major Works, edited by Brian Davies and Gillian Evans (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998).
  • Aristotle, The Nicomachean Ethics, translated by Terence Irwin (Indianapolis: Hackett Press, second edition 1999).
  • Aristotle, On the Soul, translated by J.A. Smith in The Complete Works of Aristotle, volume 1, edited by Jonathan Barnes (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984).
  • Aristotle, Metaphysics, translated by W.D. Ross in The Complete Works of Aristotle, volume 1, edited by Jonathan Barnes (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984).
  • Augustine, On Free Choice of the Will, translated by Thomas Williams (Indianapolis: Hackett Press, 1993).
  • Augustine, Confessions, translated by R.S. Pine-Coffin (London: Penguin Classics, 1961).
  • Augustine, The City of God against the Pagans, translated by R.W. Dyson (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998).
  • Henry of Ghent, Quodlibetal Questions on Free Will, translated by Roland Teske (Milwaukee: Marquette University Press, 1993).
  • Ockham (Occam), William of. Quodlibetal Questions, translated by Alfred Freddoso and Francis Kelley (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1998).
  • Scotus, John Duns. Duns Scotus on the Will and Morality, selections made and translated by Allan Wolter (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1997).
    • Many of  Scotus’ writings are divided in much the way described below for Aquinas. One further subdivision often included in works commenting on Peter Lombard’s Sentences (such as  Scotus’ Ordinatio), the distinctio, is noted as “dist.”
  • Thomas Aquinas, Summa theologiae, translated by the Fathers of the English Dominican Province (Allen, TX: Christian Classics, 1981).
    • This work is divided into three parts, with the second itself sub-divided into two parts. The parts are further broken up into questions, and the questions into articles. The articles themselves comprise objections to the position Aquinas will take, a claim “to the contrary,” Aquinas’s argument for his position, and replies to the objections. Parts are customarily referred to as follows: Ia, IIa, IIIa (from the Latin prima, secunda, and tertia); the parts of the second part as Ia-IIae and IIa-IIae (from prima secundae and secunda secundae—first of the second, second of the second). Questions are denoted simply by “q,” articles by “a,” and replies to objections by “ad” or toward. If not otherwise noted, the reference is to the body of the article or corpus (“c”), Aquinas’s argument for his position. So for instance, Ia-IIaeq13a1ad3 refers to the first part of the second part, question 13, article 1, reply to the third objection.
  • Thomas Aquinas, Commentary on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, translated by C.I. Litzinger (Notre Dame: Dumb Ox Books, 1993).

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bradley, Denis. Aquinas on the Twofold Human Good (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1997).
  • Cross, Richard. Duns Scotus (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999).
  • Dahl, Norman. Practical Reason, Aristotle, and Weakness of the Will (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1984).
  • Dumont, Stephen. “Did Duns Scotus Change His Mind on the Will?” in Nach der Verurteilung von 1277, edited by Jan Aersten, Kent Emery, and Andreas Speer (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 2001), 719-794.
  • Eardley, P.S. “Thomas Aquinas and Giles of Rome on the Will,” The Review of Metaphysics 56 (2003): 835-862.
  • Gallagher, David. “Thomas Aquinas on the Will as Rational Appetite,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 29 (1991), 559-584.
  • Hall, Pamela. Narrative and the Natural Law: An Interpretation of Thomistic Ethics (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1994).
  • Hare, John. “Scotus on Morality and Nature,” Medieval Philosophy and Theology 9 (2000), 15-38.
  • Hare, John. God’s Call (Grand Rapids: Eerdman’s, 2000).
  • Ingham, Mary Beth. “Duns Scotus, Morality and Happiness: A Reply to Thomas Williams,” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 74 (2000), 173-195.
  • Ingham, Mary Beth and Mechthild Dreyer. The Philosophical Vision of John Duns Scotus (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 2004).
  • Kent, Bonnie. Virtues of the Will (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1995).
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Whose Justice? Which Rationality? (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1988).
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1990).
  • MacDonald, Scott. “Ultimate Ends in Practical Reasoning: Aquinas’s Aristotelian Moral Psychology and Anscombe’s Fallacy,” The Philosophical Review 100 (1991): 31-65.
  • MacDonald, Scott and Eleonore Stump. (editors), Aquinas’s Moral Theory: Essays in Honor of Norman Kretzmann (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1999).
  • McCluskey, Colleen. “Worthy Constraints in Albertus Magnus’s Theory of Action,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 39 (2001): 491-533.
  • McCluskey, Colleen. “Medieval Theories of Free Will,” Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • McInerny, Ralph. Aquinas on Human Action (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1992).
  • Osborne, Thomas. “Ockham as a Divine-Command Theorist,” Religious Studies 41 (2005): 1-22.
  • Pinckaers, Servais. The Sources of Christian Ethics, translated by Sister Mary Thomas Noble (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1995).
  • Porter, Jean. Nature as Reason: A Thomistic Theory of the Natural Law (Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 2005).
  • Rist, John. Augustine: Ancient Thought Baptized (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996).
  • Spade, Paul Vincent. (editor), The Cambridge Companion to Ockham (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999).
    • See especially the essays by King and McCord Adams.
  • Toner, Christopher. “Angelic Sin in Aquinas and Scotus and the Genesis of Some Central Objections to Contemporary Virtue Ethics,” The Thomist 69 (2005): 79-125.
  • Vogler, Candace. Reasonably Vicious (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2002).
  • Westberg, Daniel. Right Practical Reason (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994).
  • Williams, Thomas. “How Scotus Separates Morality from Happiness,” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 69 (1995), 425-445.
  • Williams, Thomas. (editor), The Cambridge Companion to Duns Scotus (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003).
    • See especially the essays by Mohle, Williams, and Kent.
  • Wolter, Allan. “Native Freedom of the Will as a Key to the Ethics of Scotus” in The Philosophical Theology of John Duns Scotus, edited by Marilyn McCord Adams (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1990).

Author Information

Christopher Toner
University of St. Thomas
U. S. A.

Literary Theory

"Literary theory" is the body of ideas and methods we use in the practical reading of literature. By literary theory we refer not to the meaning of a work of literature but to the theories that reveal what literature can mean. Literary theory is a description of the underlying principles, one might say the tools, by which we attempt to understand literature. All literary interpretation draws on a basis in theory but can serve as a justification for very different kinds of critical activity. It is literary theory that formulates the relationship between author and work; literary theory develops the significance of race, class, and gender for literary study, both from the standpoint of the biography of the author and an analysis of their thematic presence within texts. Literary theory offers varying approaches for understanding the role of historical context in interpretation as well as the relevance of linguistic and unconscious elements of the text. Literary theorists trace the history and evolution of the different genres—narrative, dramatic, lyric—in addition to the more recent emergence of the novel and the short story, while also investigating the importance of formal elements of literary structure. Lastly, literary theory in recent years has sought to explain the degree to which the text is more the product of a culture than an individual author and in turn how those texts help to create the culture.

Table of Contents

  1. What Is Literary Theory?
  2. Traditional Literary Criticism
  3. Formalism and New Criticism
  4. Marxism and Critical Theory
  5. Structuralism and Poststructuralism
  6. New Historicism and Cultural Materialism
  7. Ethnic Studies and Postcolonial Criticism
  8. Gender Studies and Queer Theory
  9. Cultural Studies
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. General Works on Theory
    2. Literary and Cultural Theory

1. What Is Literary Theory?

"Literary theory," sometimes designated "critical theory," or "theory," and now undergoing a transformation into "cultural theory" within the discipline of literary studies, can be understood as the set of concepts and intellectual assumptions on which rests the work of explaining or interpreting literary texts. Literary theory refers to any principles derived from internal analysis of literary texts or from knowledge external to the text that can be applied in multiple interpretive situations. All critical practice regarding literature depends on an underlying structure of ideas in at least two ways: theory provides a rationale for what constitutes the subject matter of criticism—"the literary"—and the specific aims of critical practice—the act of interpretation itself. For example, to speak of the "unity" of Oedipus the King explicitly invokes Aristotle's theoretical statements on poetics. To argue, as does Chinua Achebe, that Joseph Conrad’s The Heart of Darkness fails to grant full humanity to the Africans it depicts is a perspective informed by a postcolonial literary theory that presupposes a history of exploitation and racism. Critics that explain the climactic drowning of Edna Pontellier in The Awakening as a suicide generally call upon a supporting architecture of feminist and gender theory. The structure of ideas that enables criticism of a literary work may or may not be acknowledged by the critic, and the status of literary theory within the academic discipline of literary studies continues to evolve.

Literary theory and the formal practice of literary interpretation runs a parallel but less well known course with the history of philosophy and is evident in the historical record at least as far back as Plato. The Cratylus contains a Plato's meditation on the relationship of words and the things to which they refer. Plato’s skepticism about signification, i.e., that words bear no etymological relationship to their meanings but are arbitrarily "imposed," becomes a central concern in the twentieth century to both "Structuralism" and "Poststructuralism." However, a persistent belief in "reference," the notion that words and images refer to an objective reality, has provided epistemological (that is, having to do with theories of knowledge) support for theories of literary representation throughout most of Western history. Until the nineteenth century, Art, in Shakespeare’s phrase, held "a mirror up to nature" and faithfully recorded an objectively real world independent of the observer.

Modern literary theory gradually emerges in Europe during the nineteenth century. In one of the earliest developments of literary theory, German "higher criticism" subjected biblical texts to a radical historicizing that broke with traditional scriptural interpretation. "Higher," or "source criticism," analyzed biblical tales in light of comparable narratives from other cultures, an approach that anticipated some of the method and spirit of twentieth century theory, particularly "Structuralism" and "New Historicism." In France, the eminent literary critic Charles Augustin Saint Beuve maintained that a work of literature could be explained entirely in terms of biography, while novelist Marcel Proust devoted his life to refuting Saint Beuve in a massive narrative in which he contended that the details of the life of the artist are utterly transformed in the work of art. (This dispute was taken up anew by the French theorist Roland Barthes in his famous declaration of the "Death of the Author." See "Structuralism" and "Poststructuralism.") Perhaps the greatest nineteenth century influence on literary theory came from the deep epistemological suspicion of Friedrich Nietzsche: that facts are not facts until they have been interpreted. Nietzsche's critique of knowledge has had a profound impact on literary studies and helped usher in an era of intense literary theorizing that has yet to pass.

Attention to the etymology of the term "theory," from the Greek "theoria," alerts us to the partial nature of theoretical approaches to literature. "Theoria" indicates a view or perspective of the Greek stage. This is precisely what literary theory offers, though specific theories often claim to present a complete system for understanding literature. The current state of theory is such that there are many overlapping areas of influence, and older schools of theory, though no longer enjoying their previous eminence, continue to exert an influence on the whole. The once widely-held conviction (an implicit theory) that literature is a repository of all that is meaningful and ennobling in the human experience, a view championed by the Leavis School in Britain, may no longer be acknowledged by name but remains an essential justification for the current structure of American universities and liberal arts curricula. The moment of "Deconstruction" may have passed, but its emphasis on the indeterminacy of signs (that we are unable to establish exclusively what a word means when used in a given situation) and thus of texts, remains significant. Many critics may not embrace the label "feminist," but the premise that gender is a social construct, one of theoretical feminisms distinguishing insights, is now axiomatic in a number of theoretical perspectives.

While literary theory has always implied or directly expressed a conception of the world outside the text, in the twentieth century three movements—"Marxist theory" of the Frankfurt School, "Feminism," and "Postmodernism"—have opened the field of literary studies into a broader area of inquiry. Marxist approaches to literature require an understanding of the primary economic and social bases of culture since Marxist aesthetic theory sees the work of art as a product, directly or indirectly, of the base structure of society. Feminist thought and practice analyzes the production of literature and literary representation within the framework that includes all social and cultural formations as they pertain to the role of women in history. Postmodern thought consists of both aesthetic and epistemological strands. Postmodernism in art has included a move toward non-referential, non-linear, abstract forms; a heightened degree of self-referentiality; and the collapse of categories and conventions that had traditionally governed art. Postmodern thought has led to the serious questioning of the so-called metanarratives of history, science, philosophy, and economic and sexual reproduction. Under postmodernity, all knowledge comes to be seen as "constructed" within historical self-contained systems of understanding. Marxist, feminist, and postmodern thought have brought about the incorporation of all human discourses (that is, interlocking fields of language and knowledge) as a subject matter for analysis by the literary theorist. Using the various poststructuralist and postmodern theories that often draw on disciplines other than the literary—linguistic, anthropological, psychoanalytic, and philosophical—for their primary insights, literary theory has become an interdisciplinary body of cultural theory. Taking as its premise that human societies and knowledge consist of texts in one form or another, cultural theory (for better or worse) is now applied to the varieties of texts, ambitiously undertaking to become the preeminent model of inquiry into the human condition.

Literary theory is a site of theories: some theories, like "Queer Theory," are "in;" other literary theories, like "Deconstruction," are "out" but continue to exert an influence on the field. "Traditional literary criticism," "New Criticism," and "Structuralism" are alike in that they held to the view that the study of literature has an objective body of knowledge under its scrutiny. The other schools of literary theory, to varying degrees, embrace a postmodern view of language and reality that calls into serious question the objective referent of literary studies. The following categories are certainly not exhaustive, nor are they mutually exclusive, but they represent the major trends in literary theory of this century.

2. Traditional Literary Criticism

Academic literary criticism prior to the rise of "New Criticism" in the United States tended to practice traditional literary history: tracking influence, establishing the canon of major writers in the literary periods, and clarifying historical context and allusions within the text. Literary biography was and still is an important interpretive method in and out of the academy; versions of moral criticism, not unlike the Leavis School in Britain, and aesthetic (e.g. genre studies) criticism were also generally influential literary practices. Perhaps the key unifying feature of traditional literary criticism was the consensus within the academy as to the both the literary canon (that is, the books all educated persons should read) and the aims and purposes of literature. What literature was, and why we read literature, and what we read, were questions that subsequent movements in literary theory were to raise.

3. Formalism and New Criticism

"Formalism" is, as the name implies, an interpretive approach that emphasizes literary form and the study of literary devices within the text. The work of the Formalists had a general impact on later developments in "Structuralism" and other theories of narrative. "Formalism," like "Structuralism," sought to place the study of literature on a scientific basis through objective analysis of the motifs, devices, techniques, and other "functions" that comprise the literary work. The Formalists placed great importance on the literariness of texts, those qualities that distinguished the literary from other kinds of writing. Neither author nor context was essential for the Formalists; it was the narrative that spoke, the "hero-function," for example, that had meaning. Form was the content. A plot device or narrative strategy was examined for how it functioned and compared to how it had functioned in other literary works. Of the Russian Formalist critics, Roman Jakobson and Viktor Shklovsky are probably the most well known.

The Formalist adage that the purpose of literature was "to make the stones stonier" nicely expresses their notion of literariness. "Formalism" is perhaps best known is Shklovsky's concept of "defamiliarization." The routine of ordinary experience, Shklovsky contended, rendered invisible the uniqueness and particularity of the objects of existence. Literary language, partly by calling attention to itself as language, estranged the reader from the familiar and made fresh the experience of daily life.

The "New Criticism," so designated as to indicate a break with traditional methods, was a product of the American university in the 1930s and 40s. "New Criticism" stressed close reading of the text itself, much like the French pedagogical precept "explication du texte." As a strategy of reading, "New Criticism" viewed the work of literature as an aesthetic object independent of historical context and as a unified whole that reflected the unified sensibility of the artist. T.S. Eliot, though not explicitly associated with the movement, expressed a similar critical-aesthetic philosophy in his essays on John Donne and the metaphysical poets, writers who Eliot believed experienced a complete integration of thought and feeling. New Critics like Cleanth Brooks, John Crowe Ransom, Robert Penn Warren and W.K. Wimsatt placed a similar focus on the metaphysical poets and poetry in general, a genre well suited to New Critical practice. "New Criticism" aimed at bringing a greater intellectual rigor to literary studies, confining itself to careful scrutiny of the text alone and the formal structures of paradox, ambiguity, irony, and metaphor, among others. "New Criticism" was fired by the conviction that their readings of poetry would yield a humanizing influence on readers and thus counter the alienating tendencies of modern, industrial life. "New Criticism" in this regard bears an affinity to the Southern Agrarian movement whose manifesto, I'll Take My Stand, contained essays by two New Critics, Ransom and Warren. Perhaps the enduring legacy of "New Criticism" can be found in the college classroom, in which the verbal texture of the poem on the page remains a primary object of literary study.

4. Marxism and Critical Theory

Marxist literary theories tend to focus on the representation of class conflict as well as the reinforcement of class distinctions through the medium of literature. Marxist theorists use traditional techniques of literary analysis but subordinate aesthetic concerns to the final social and political meanings of literature. Marxist theorist often champion authors sympathetic to the working classes and authors whose work challenges economic equalities found in capitalist societies. In keeping with the totalizing spirit of Marxism, literary theories arising from the Marxist paradigm have not only sought new ways of understanding the relationship between economic production and literature, but all cultural production as well. Marxist analyses of society and history have had a profound effect on literary theory and practical criticism, most notably in the development of "New Historicism" and "Cultural Materialism."

The Hungarian theorist Georg Lukacs contributed to an understanding of the relationship between historical materialism and literary form, in particular with realism and the historical novel. Walter Benjamin broke new ground in his work in his study of aesthetics and the reproduction of the work of art. The Frankfurt School of philosophers, including most notably Max Horkheimer, Theodor Adorno, and Herbert Marcuse—after their emigration to the United States—played a key role in introducing Marxist assessments of culture into the mainstream of American academic life. These thinkers became associated with what is known as "Critical theory," one of the constituent components of which was a critique of the instrumental use of reason in advanced capitalist culture. "Critical theory" held to a distinction between the high cultural heritage of Europe and the mass culture produced by capitalist societies as an instrument of domination. "Critical theory" sees in the structure of mass cultural forms—jazz, Hollywood film, advertising—a replication of the structure of the factory and the workplace. Creativity and cultural production in advanced capitalist societies were always already co-opted by the entertainment needs of an economic system that requires sensory stimulation and recognizable cliché and suppressed the tendency for sustained deliberation.

The major Marxist influences on literary theory since the Frankfurt School have been Raymond Williams and Terry Eagleton in Great Britain and Frank Lentricchia and Fredric Jameson in the United States. Williams is associated with the New Left political movement in Great Britain and the development of "Cultural Materialism" and the Cultural Studies Movement, originating in the 1960s at Birmingham University's Center for Contemporary Cultural Studies. Eagleton is known both as a Marxist theorist and as a popularizer of theory by means of his widely read overview, Literary Theory. Lentricchia likewise became influential through his account of trends in theory, After the New Criticism. Jameson is a more diverse theorist, known both for his impact on Marxist theories of culture and for his position as one of the leading figures in theoretical postmodernism. Jameson’s work on consumer culture, architecture, film, literature and other areas, typifies the collapse of disciplinary boundaries taking place in the realm of Marxist and postmodern cultural theory. Jameson’s work investigates the way the structural features of late capitalism—particularly the transformation of all culture into commodity form—are now deeply embedded in all of our ways of communicating.

5. Structuralism and Poststructuralism

Like the "New Criticism," "Structuralism" sought to bring to literary studies a set of objective criteria for analysis and a new intellectual rigor. "Structuralism" can be viewed as an extension of "Formalism" in that that both "Structuralism" and "Formalism" devoted their attention to matters of literary form (i.e. structure) rather than social or historical content; and that both bodies of thought were intended to put the study of literature on a scientific, objective basis. "Structuralism" relied initially on the ideas of the Swiss linguist, Ferdinand de Saussure. Like Plato, Saussure regarded the signifier (words, marks, symbols) as arbitrary and unrelated to the concept, the signified, to which it referred. Within the way a particular society uses language and signs, meaning was constituted by a system of "differences" between units of the language. Particular meanings were of less interest than the underlying structures of signification that made meaning itself possible, often expressed as an emphasis on "langue" rather than "parole." "Structuralism" was to be a metalanguage, a language about languages, used to decode actual languages, or systems of signification. The work of the "Formalist" Roman Jakobson contributed to "Structuralist" thought, and the more prominent Structuralists included Claude Levi-Strauss in anthropology, Tzvetan Todorov, A.J. Greimas, Gerard Genette, and Barthes.

The philosopher Roland Barthes proved to be a key figure on the divide between "Structuralism" and "Poststructuralism." "Poststructuralism" is less unified as a theoretical movement than its precursor; indeed, the work of its advocates known by the term "Deconstruction" calls into question the possibility of the coherence of discourse, or the capacity for language to communicate. "Deconstruction," Semiotic theory (a study of signs with close connections to "Structuralism," "Reader response theory" in America ("Reception theory" in Europe), and "Gender theory" informed by the psychoanalysts Jacques Lacan and Julia Kristeva are areas of inquiry that can be located under the banner of "Poststructuralism." If signifier and signified are both cultural concepts, as they are in "Poststructuralism," reference to an empirically certifiable reality is no longer guaranteed by language. "Deconstruction" argues that this loss of reference causes an endless deferral of meaning, a system of differences between units of language that has no resting place or final signifier that would enable the other signifiers to hold their meaning. The most important theorist of "Deconstruction," Jacques Derrida, has asserted, "There is no getting outside text," indicating a kind of free play of signification in which no fixed, stable meaning is possible. "Poststructuralism" in America was originally identified with a group of Yale academics, the Yale School of "Deconstruction:" J. Hillis Miller, Geoffrey Hartmann, and Paul de Man. Other tendencies in the moment after "Deconstruction" that share some of the intellectual tendencies of "Poststructuralism" would included the "Reader response" theories of Stanley Fish, Jane Tompkins, and Wolfgang Iser.

Lacanian psychoanalysis, an updating of the work of Sigmund Freud, extends "Postructuralism" to the human subject with further consequences for literary theory. According to Lacan, the fixed, stable self is a Romantic fiction; like the text in "Deconstruction," the self is a decentered mass of traces left by our encounter with signs, visual symbols, language, etc. For Lacan, the self is constituted by language, a language that is never one's own, always another’s, always already in use. Barthes applies these currents of thought in his famous declaration of the "death" of the Author: "writing is the destruction of every voice, of every point of origin" while also applying a similar "Poststructuralist" view to the Reader: "the reader is without history, biography, psychology; he is simply that someone who holds together in a single field all the traces by which the written text is constituted."

Michel Foucault is another philosopher, like Barthes, whose ideas inform much of poststructuralist literary theory. Foucault played a critical role in the development of the postmodern perspective that knowledge is constructed in concrete historical situations in the form of discourse; knowledge is not communicated by discourse but is discourse itself, can only be encountered textually. Following Nietzsche, Foucault performs what he calls "genealogies," attempts at deconstructing the unacknowledged operation of power and knowledge to reveal the ideologies that make domination of one group by another seem "natural." Foucaldian investigations of discourse and power were to provide much of the intellectual impetus for a new way of looking at history and doing textual studies that came to be known as the "New Historicism."

6. New Historicism and Cultural Materialism

"New Historicism," a term coined by Stephen Greenblatt, designates a body of theoretical and interpretive practices that began largely with the study of early modern literature in the United States. "New Historicism" in America had been somewhat anticipated by the theorists of "Cultural Materialism" in Britain, which, in the words of their leading advocate, Raymond Williams describes "the analysis of all forms of signification, including quite centrally writing, within the actual means and conditions of their production." Both "New Historicism" and "Cultural Materialism" seek to understand literary texts historically and reject the formalizing influence of previous literary studies, including "New Criticism," "Structuralism" and "Deconstruction," all of which in varying ways privilege the literary text and place only secondary emphasis on historical and social context. According to "New Historicism," the circulation of literary and non-literary texts produces relations of social power within a culture. New Historicist thought differs from traditional historicism in literary studies in several crucial ways. Rejecting traditional historicism's premise of neutral inquiry, "New Historicism" accepts the necessity of making historical value judgments. According to "New Historicism," we can only know the textual history of the past because it is "embedded," a key term, in the textuality of the present and its concerns. Text and context are less clearly distinct in New Historicist practice. Traditional separations of literary and non-literary texts, "great" literature and popular literature, are also fundamentally challenged. For the "New Historicist," all acts of expression are embedded in the material conditions of a culture. Texts are examined with an eye for how they reveal the economic and social realities, especially as they produce ideology and represent power or subversion. Like much of the emergent European social history of the 1980s, "New Historicism" takes particular interest in representations of marginal/marginalized groups and non-normative behaviors—witchcraft, cross-dressing, peasant revolts, and exorcisms—as exemplary of the need for power to represent subversive alternatives, the Other, to legitimize itself.

Louis Montrose, another major innovator and exponent of "New Historicism," describes a fundamental axiom of the movement as an intellectual belief in "the textuality of history and the historicity of texts." "New Historicism" draws on the work of Levi-Strauss, in particular his notion of culture as a "self-regulating system." The Foucaldian premise that power is ubiquitous and cannot be equated with state or economic power and Gramsci's conception of "hegemony," i.e., that domination is often achieved through culturally-orchestrated consent rather than force, are critical underpinnings to the "New Historicist" perspective. The translation of the work of Mikhail Bakhtin on carnival coincided with the rise of the "New Historicism" and "Cultural Materialism" and left a legacy in work of other theorists of influence like Peter Stallybrass and Jonathan Dollimore. In its period of ascendancy during the 1980s, "New Historicism" drew criticism from the political left for its depiction of counter-cultural expression as always co-opted by the dominant discourses. Equally, "New Historicism’s" lack of emphasis on "literariness" and formal literary concerns brought disdain from traditional literary scholars. However, "New Historicism" continues to exercise a major influence in the humanities and in the extended conception of literary studies.

7. Ethnic Studies and Postcolonial Criticism

"Ethnic Studies," sometimes referred to as "Minority Studies," has an obvious historical relationship with "Postcolonial Criticism" in that Euro-American imperialism and colonization in the last four centuries, whether external (empire) or internal (slavery) has been directed at recognizable ethnic groups: African and African-American, Chinese, the subaltern peoples of India, Irish, Latino, Native American, and Philipino, among others. "Ethnic Studies" concerns itself generally with art and literature produced by identifiable ethnic groups either marginalized or in a subordinate position to a dominant culture. "Postcolonial Criticism" investigates the relationships between colonizers and colonized in the period post-colonization. Though the two fields are increasingly finding points of intersection—the work of bell hooks, for example—and are both activist intellectual enterprises, "Ethnic Studies and "Postcolonial Criticism" have significant differences in their history and ideas.

"Ethnic Studies" has had a considerable impact on literary studies in the United States and Britain. In W.E.B. Dubois, we find an early attempt to theorize the position of African-Americans within dominant white culture through his concept of "double consciousness," a dual identity including both "American" and "Negro." Dubois and theorists after him seek an understanding of how that double experience both creates identity and reveals itself in culture. Afro-Caribbean and African writers—Aime Cesaire, Frantz Fanon, Chinua Achebe—have made significant early contributions to the theory and practice of ethnic criticism that explores the traditions, sometimes suppressed or underground, of ethnic literary activity while providing a critique of representations of ethnic identity as found within the majority culture. Ethnic and minority literary theory emphasizes the relationship of cultural identity to individual identity in historical circumstances of overt racial oppression. More recently, scholars and writers such as Henry Louis Gates, Toni Morrison, and Kwame Anthony Appiah have brought attention to the problems inherent in applying theoretical models derived from Euro-centric paradigms (that is, structures of thought) to minority works of literature while at the same time exploring new interpretive strategies for understanding the vernacular (common speech) traditions of racial groups that have been historically marginalized by dominant cultures.

Though not the first writer to explore the historical condition of postcolonialism, the Palestinian literary theorist Edward Said's book Orientalism is generally regarded as having inaugurated the field of explicitly "Postcolonial Criticism" in the West. Said argues that the concept of "the Orient" was produced by the "imaginative geography" of Western scholarship and has been instrumental in the colonization and domination of non-Western societies. "Postcolonial" theory reverses the historical center/margin direction of cultural inquiry: critiques of the metropolis and capital now emanate from the former colonies. Moreover, theorists like Homi K. Bhabha have questioned the binary thought that produces the dichotomies—center/margin, white/black, and colonizer/colonized—by which colonial practices are justified. The work of Gayatri C. Spivak has focused attention on the question of who speaks for the colonial "Other" and the relation of the ownership of discourse and representation to the development of the postcolonial subjectivity. Like feminist and ethnic theory, "Postcolonial Criticism" pursues not merely the inclusion of the marginalized literature of colonial peoples into the dominant canon and discourse. "Postcolonial Criticism" offers a fundamental critique of the ideology of colonial domination and at the same time seeks to undo the "imaginative geography" of Orientalist thought that produced conceptual as well as economic divides between West and East, civilized and uncivilized, First and Third Worlds. In this respect, "Postcolonial Criticism" is activist and adversarial in its basic aims. Postcolonial theory has brought fresh perspectives to the role of colonial peoples—their wealth, labor, and culture—in the development of modern European nation states. While "Postcolonial Criticism" emerged in the historical moment following the collapse of the modern colonial empires, the increasing globalization of culture, including the neo-colonialism of multinational capitalism, suggests a continued relevance for this field of inquiry.

8. Gender Studies and Queer Theory

Gender theory came to the forefront of the theoretical scene first as feminist theory but has subsequently come to include the investigation of all gender and sexual categories and identities. Feminist gender theory followed slightly behind the reemergence of political feminism in the United States and Western Europe during the 1960s. Political feminism of the so-called "second wave" had as its emphasis practical concerns with the rights of women in contemporary societies, women's identity, and the representation of women in media and culture. These causes converged with early literary feminist practice, characterized by Elaine Showalter as "gynocriticism," which emphasized the study and canonical inclusion of works by female authors as well as the depiction of women in male-authored canonical texts.

Feminist gender theory is postmodern in that it challenges the paradigms and intellectual premises of western thought, but also takes an activist stance by proposing frequent interventions and alternative epistemological positions meant to change the social order. In the context of postmodernism, gender theorists, led by the work of Judith Butler, initially viewed the category of "gender" as a human construct enacted by a vast repetition of social performance. The biological distinction between man and woman eventually came under the same scrutiny by theorists who reached a similar conclusion: the sexual categories are products of culture and as such help create social reality rather than simply reflect it. Gender theory achieved a wide readership and acquired much its initial theoretical rigor through the work of a group of French feminist theorists that included Simone de Beauvoir, Luce Irigaray, Helene Cixous, and Julia Kristeva, who while Bulgarian rather than French, made her mark writing in French. French feminist thought is based on the assumption that the Western philosophical tradition represses the experience of women in the structure of its ideas. As an important consequence of this systematic intellectual repression and exclusion, women's lives and bodies in historical societies are subject to repression as well. In the creative/critical work of Cixous, we find the history of Western thought depicted as binary oppositions: "speech/writing; Nature/Art, Nature/History, Nature/Mind, Passion/Action." For Cixous, and for Irigaray as well, these binaries are less a function of any objective reality they describe than the male-dominated discourse of the Western tradition that produced them. Their work beyond the descriptive stage becomes an intervention in the history of theoretical discourse, an attempt to alter the existing categories and systems of thought that found Western rationality. French feminism, and perhaps all feminism after Beauvoir, has been in conversation with the psychoanalytic revision of Freud in the work of Jacques Lacan. Kristeva’s work draws heavily on Lacan. Two concepts from Kristeva—the "semiotic" and "abjection"—have had a significant influence on literary theory. Kristeva’s "semiotic" refers to the gaps, silences, spaces, and bodily presence within the language/symbol system of a culture in which there might be a space for a women’s language, different in kind as it would be from male-dominated discourse.

Masculine gender theory as a separate enterprise has focused largely on social, literary, and historical accounts of the construction of male gender identities. Such work generally lacks feminisms' activist stance and tends to serve primarily as an indictment rather than a validation of male gender practices and masculinity. The so-called "Men’s Movement," inspired by the work of Robert Bly among others, was more practical than theoretical and has had only limited impact on gender discourse. The impetus for the "Men’s Movement" came largely as a response to the critique of masculinity and male domination that runs throughout feminism and the upheaval of the 1960s, a period of crisis in American social ideology that has required a reconsideration of gender roles. Having long served as the de facto "subject" of Western thought, male identity and masculine gender theory awaits serious investigation as a particular, and no longer universally representative, field of inquiry.

Much of what theoretical energy of masculine gender theory currently possesses comes from its ambiguous relationship with the field of "Queer theory." "Queer theory" is not synonymous with gender theory, nor even with the overlapping fields of gay and lesbian studies, but does share many of their concerns with normative definitions of man, woman, and sexuality. "Queer theory" questions the fixed categories of sexual identity and the cognitive paradigms generated by normative (that is, what is considered "normal") sexual ideology. To "queer" becomes an act by which stable boundaries of sexual identity are transgressed, reversed, mimicked, or otherwise critiqued. "Queering" can be enacted on behalf of all non-normative sexualities and identities as well, all that is considered by the dominant paradigms of culture to be alien, strange, unfamiliar, transgressive, odd—in short, queer. Michel Foucault's work on sexuality anticipates and informs the Queer theoretical movement in a role similar to the way his writing on power and discourse prepared the ground for "New Historicism." Judith Butler contends that heterosexual identity long held to be a normative ground of sexuality is actually produced by the suppression of homoerotic possibility. Eve Sedgwick is another pioneering theorist of "Queer theory," and like Butler, Sedgwick maintains that the dominance of heterosexual culture conceals the extensive presence of homosocial relations. For Sedgwick, the standard histories of western societies are presented in exclusively in terms of heterosexual identity: "Inheritance, Marriage, Dynasty, Family, Domesticity, Population," and thus conceiving of homosexual identity within this framework is already problematic.

9. Cultural Studies

Much of the intellectual legacy of "New Historicism" and "Cultural Materialism" can now be felt in the "Cultural Studies" movement in departments of literature, a movement not identifiable in terms of a single theoretical school, but one that embraces a wide array of perspectives—media studies, social criticism, anthropology, and literary theory—as they apply to the general study of culture. "Cultural Studies" arose quite self-consciously in the 80s to provide a means of analysis of the rapidly expanding global culture industry that includes entertainment, advertising, publishing, television, film, computers and the Internet. "Cultural Studies" brings scrutiny not only to these varied categories of culture, and not only to the decreasing margins of difference between these realms of expression, but just as importantly to the politics and ideology that make contemporary culture possible. "Cultural Studies" became notorious in the 90s for its emphasis on pop music icons and music video in place of canonical literature, and extends the ideas of the Frankfurt School on the transition from a truly popular culture to mass culture in late capitalist societies, emphasizing the significance of the patterns of consumption of cultural artifacts. "Cultural Studies" has been interdisciplinary, even antidisciplinary, from its inception; indeed, "Cultural Studies" can be understood as a set of sometimes conflicting methods and approaches applied to a questioning of current cultural categories. Stuart Hall, Meaghan Morris, Tony Bennett and Simon During are some of the important advocates of a "Cultural Studies" that seeks to displace the traditional model of literary studies.

10. References and Further Reading

a. General Works on Theory

  • Culler, Jonathan. Literary Theory: A Very Short Introduction. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1997.
  • During, Simon. Ed. The Cultural Studies Reader. London: Routledge, 1999.
  • Eagleton, Terry. Literary Theory. Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press, 1996.
  • Lentricchia, Frank. After the New Criticism. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1980.
  • Moore-Gilbert, Bart, Stanton, Gareth, and Maley, Willy. Eds. Postcolonial Criticism. New York: Addison, Wesley, Longman, 1997.
  • Rice, Philip and Waugh, Patricia. Eds. Modern Literary Theory: A Reader. 4th edition.
  • Richter, David H. Ed. The Critical Tradition: Classic Texts and Contemporary Trends. 2nd Ed. Bedford Books: Boston, 1998.
  • Rivkin, Julie and Ryan, Michael. Eds. Literary Theory: An Anthology. Malden, Massachusetts: Blackwell, 1998.

b. Literary and Cultural Theory

  • Adorno, Theodor. The Culture Industry: Selected Essays on Mass Culture. Ed. J. M. Bernstein. London: Routledge, 2001.
  • Althusser, Louis. Lenin and Philosophy: And Other Essays. Trans. Ben Brewster. New York: Monthly Review Press, 1971.
  • Auerbach, Erich. Mimesis: The Representation of Reality in Western Literature. Trans.
  • Willard R. Trask. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1953.
  • Bakhtin, Mikhail. The Dialogic Imagination. Trans. Caryl Emerson and Michael Holquist. Austin, TX: University of Texas Press, 1981.
  • Barthes, Roland. Image—Music—Text. Trans. Stephen Heath. New York: Hill and Wang, 1994.
  • Barthes, Roland. The Pleasure of the Text. Trans. Richard Miller. New York: Hill and Wang, 1975.
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. The Second Sex. Tr. H.M. Parshley. New York: Knopf, 1953.
  • Benjamin, Walter. Illuminations. Ed. Hannah Arendt. Trans. Harry Zohn. New York: Schocken, 1988.
  • Brooks, Cleanth. The Well-Wrought Urn: Studies in the Structure of Poetry. New York: Harcourt, 1947.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Of Grammatology. Trans. Gayatri C. Spivak. Baltimore: Johns Hopkins, 1976.
  • Dubois, W.E.B. The Souls of Black Folk: Essays and Sketches. Chicago: A. C. McClurg & Co., 1903.
  • Fish, Stanley. Is There a Text in This Class? The Authority of Interpretive Communities. Harvard, MA: Harvard University Press, 1980.
  • Foucault, Michel. The History of Sexuality. Volume 1. An Introduction. Trans. Robert Hurley. Harmondsworth, UK: Penguin, 1981.
  • Foucault, Michel. The Order of Things: An Archaeology of the Human Sciences. New York: Vintage, 1973.
  • Gates, Henry Louis. The Signifying Monkey: A Theory of African-American Literary Criticism. New York: Oxford University Press, 1989.
  • hooks, bell. Ain't I a Woman: Black Women and Feminism. Boston: South End Press, 1981.
  • Horkheimer, Max and Adorno, Theodor. Dialectic of Enlightenment: Philosophical Fragments. Ed. Gunzelin Schmid Noerr. Trans. Edmund Jephcott. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 2002.
  • Irigaray, Luce. This Sex Which Is Not One. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1985.
  • Jameson, Frederic. Postmodernism: Or the Cultural Logic of Late Capitalism. Durham, NC: Duke University Press, 1999.
  • Lacan, Jacques. Ecrits: A Selection. London: Routledge, 2001.
  • Lemon Lee T. and Reis, Marion J. Eds. Russian Formalist Criticism: Four Essays. Lincoln, NE: University of Nebraska Press, 1965.
  • Lukacs, Georg. The Historical Novel. Trans. Hannah and Stanley Mitchell. Lincoln, NE: University of Nebraska Press, 1962.
  • Marcuse, Herbert. Eros and Civilization. Boston: Beacon Press, 1955.
  • Nietzsche, Friedrich. The Genealogy of Morals. Trans. Walter Kaufmann. New York: Vintage, 1969.
  • Plato. The Collected Dialogues. Ed. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1961.
  • Proust, Marcel. Remembrance of Things Past. Trans. C.K. Scott Moncrieff and Terence Kilmartin. New York: Vintage, 1982.
  • Said, Edward. Orientalism. New York: Pantheon, 1978.
  • Sedgwick, Eve Kosofsky. Between Men. Between Men: English literature and Male Homosocial Desire. New York: Columbia University Press, 1985.
  • Sedgwick, Eve Kosofsky Epistemology of the Closet. London: Penguin, 1994.
  • Showalter, Elaine. Ed. The New Feminist Criticism: Essays on Women, Literature, and Theory. London: Virago, 1986.
  • Tompkins, Jane. Sensational Designs: the Cultural Work of American Fiction, 1790-1860. New York: Oxford University Press, 1986.
  • Wellek, Rene and Warren, Austin. Theory of Literature. 3rd ed. New York: Harcourt Brace, 1956.
  • Williams, Raymond. The Country and the City. New York: Oxford University Press, 1973.

Author Information

Vince Brewton
University of North Alabama
U. S. A.