Mind and the Causal Exclusion Problem
The causal exclusion problem is an objection to nonreductive physicalist models of mental causation. Mental causation occurs when behavioural effects have mental causes: Jennie eats a peach because she wants one; Marvin goes to Harvard because he chose to, etc. Nonreductive physicalists typically supplement adherence to mental causation with the view that behavioural effects have distinct sufficient physical causes as well: Jennie eats a peach because the muscles in her arms contracted as a result of the innervations of muscle fibres, which were in turn caused by the release of neurotransmitters from the motor neurons at the neuromuscular junction, and so on and so forth. Nonreductive physicalists, therefore, argue that behavioural effects have sufficient physical causes and distinct mental causes. The causal exclusion problem is the leading objection to this view, and it is based on the causal exclusion principle, which stipulates that events cannot have more than a single sufficient cause. The causal exclusion principle conflicts with the nonreductive physicalist view that behavioural effects have a sufficient physical cause and a distinct mental cause. Critics typically add that the sufficient physical cause of the behavioural effect excludes the mental cause of the same effect, so nonreductive physicalism also fails to secure mental causation.
Various responses to the causal exclusion problem have been suggested. Some overcome the causal exclusion problem by undermining certain metaphysical foundations supporting the problem. For example, some adopt differing models of events and properties, thereby avoiding the thrust of the causal exclusion problem. Others turn to differing models of causation to dissipate exclusion pressures. There are those who resolve the causal exclusion problem by providing robust nonreductive physicalist models of mental causation. These models include supervenience based nonreductive physicalism, emergentism, functionalism, and the realization strategy. Each of these models attempts to provide an account of how the causal exclusion problem does not defeat their model. Still others respond to the causal exclusion problem by rejecting one of the principles undergirding the causal exclusion problem. For example, the epiphenomenalist rejects the principle of mental causation, the interactionist dualist rejects the principle of physical causal completeness, the reductionist abandons the principle of irreducibility, and the compatibilist rejects the principle of causal exclusion. These views must demonstrate the viability of rejecting one of these widely accepted principles.
This article introduces and motivates the causal exclusion problem, and considers the merits and demerits of these avenues of response to the causal exclusion problem. The stakes are high. Not only does the causal exclusion problem pose difficulties with reconciling autonomous agency with neuroscientific advances that increasingly establishes neural causes of behavioural effects, but it also threatens to leak out into other domains. This article closes with a discussion of the possibility that the causal exclusion problem applies to the realm of explanation as well, and the viability of the view that the causal exclusion problem may generalize to other special science disciplines such as sociology, economics, geology, and biology.
Table of Contents
- The Causal Exclusion Problem
- Solutions to the Causal Exclusion Problem
- Explanatory Exclusion
- The Generalization Problem
- References and Further Reading
While disputes about mental causation arise in ancient philosophy, the locus classicus of the problem of mental causation is René Descartes. Descartes argued that the mind is a thinking substance that is distinct from the body, which is an extended substance. Descartes supplemented this substance dualism with a principle of interactionism, according to which the mind causally interacts with the body. For example, Jennie’s wanting a peach, which is distinct from the physical processes in her brain, causes her to eat a peach. Descartes’ interactionist dualism faced numerous difficulties. Princess Elizabeth of the Palatinate and others argued that thinking substance, which is not extended in space, cannot come into causal contact with the extended body. Henry More and others argued that a distinct thinking substance that causally interacts with a body would violate conservation principles by increasing the motion of the universe.
Contemporary discussion on the problem of mental causation typically begins with the Type Identity Theorists of the mid-twentieth century. They argued that mental states are type identical with causally efficacious physical states, thereby securing mental causation. For example, Jennie’s wanting a peach is a causally efficacious physical process in her brain, so Jennie’s peach eating has a mental cause, which is the sufficient physical cause. The type identity theory faced numerous difficulties as well. Hilary Putnam and others argued that mental properties are multiply realizable, so they cannot be identical with specific physical properties. David Chalmers and others argued that mental states have qualitative or intentional properties that are irreducible to physical processes.
The failure of type reductionism led to the currently dominant, nonreductive, and physicalist solution to the problem of mental causation. They argue that behavioural effects have sufficient physical causes and distinct mental causes. For example, Jennie’s peach eating has a mental cause that supervenes upon a distinct sufficient physical cause of the behaviour. In recent years, this nonreductive hegemony has been likewise threatened. The causal exclusion problem is the principal weapon fashioned against nonreductive physicalist solutions to the mental causation problem. The causal exclusion problem is most thoroughly exposited in a series of articles and books by Jaegwon Kim (Kim, 1998; Kim, 2005). He argues in favour of the causal exclusion principle, which states that: “No single event can have more than one sufficient cause occurring at any give time...” (Kim, 2005, 42). Accordingly, Jennie’s peach eating cannot have a mental cause and a distinct sufficient physical cause, as nonreductive physicalism posits. As a result of this causal exclusion problem, nonreductive physicalist solutions to the mental causation problem are currently threatened.
In brief, the causal exclusion problem amounts to the difficulty of establishing the nonreductive physicalist view that behavioural effects have sufficient physical causes and distinct mental causes, over and against the plausibility of the view that the sufficient physical cause of the behaviour excludes the mental event from causally influencing the behaviour. If mental events are excluded from causally influencing behavioural effects, nonreductive physicalism fails to secure mental causation—a shortcoming which is probably fatal. More formally, according to a common though not universal presentation, the causal exclusion problem is the conjunction of the following four individually plausible, but (seemingly) jointly inconsistent principles.
The first of the four principles constituting the causal exclusion problem is the principle of mental causation. Broadly construed, the principle of mental causation stipulates that some events have mental causes:
The Principle of Mental Causation: some events have mental causes.
This initial definition is subject to considerable nuance, including the following three distinctions. First, there are questions about whether mental causes should be construed as substances, events, or properties of events. Traditional models of substance dualism, most famously espoused by René Descartes, suppose that mental causes are substances, such as a soul or a disembodied mind. Most contemporary philosophers reject this view in favour of the the view that mental phenomena are events. However, there are deep, yet relevant, disagreements about the nature of events, and whether events, in virtue of certain properties, are causally efficacious. These issues will be dealt with in detail in Section 3.a.
Second, there are questions about whether the events that have mental causes are mental effects, physical effects, or both. Some philosophers endorse the autonomist view, according to which mental events cause mental effects but do not cause physical effects (Gibbons, 2006). Devin’s sadness is caused by his belief that his gecko died, but his crying has physical causes. This view will be dealt with in Section 3.g.
Third, many philosophers distinguish between autonomous mental causation and reduced mental causation. Nonreductive physicalists endorse autonomous mental causation, which is the conjunction of the principle of mental causation and the principle of irreducibility. Autonomous mental causation is the view that the mental-as-mental causes effects. Reductive physicalists endorse reduced mental causation, which is the conjunction of mental causation with a rejection of irreducibility. Reduced mental causation is the view that the mental-as-physical causes effects. Most, even some reductionists (Kim, 2005, 159), agree that autonomous mental causation would be preferable, though the result of the causal exclusion problem may be that autonomous mental causation is not possible within a physicalistic metaphysic.
There are numerous arguments in support of the principle of mental causation. First, Donald Davidson overthrew the consensus against mental causation by highlighting the plausible distinction between having a reason for acting, and acting for a reason (Davidson, 1963). A student may have a desire to impress the teacher as a reason for asking a question, but the student may actually ask the question because he wants to know the answer. This plausible distinction presumes that reasons are causes, which supports the principle of mental causation. Second, the moral responsibility argument: an ought implies a can, and a can implies mental causation. Someone locked up in chains, literally unable to move, is not morally responsible for not helping someone who has fallen. Similarly, if humans are unable to act, since they lack mental causation, they lack moral responsibility (Kim, 2005, 9). Third, the epistemic argument: knowing implies the justification relation between premise and conclusion, or sensation and belief, is a causal relation. Imagine a random syllogism generator that spits out a million invalid syllogisms in a row: monkeys like bananas, tomatoes are red, therefore the sky is blue. Then, once it finally gets lucky: humans are animals, animals are mortal, therefore humans are mortal. There is justified true belief here, but not knowledge. What is missing? Among other things, the conclusion does not occur because of the reasonableness of the premises, where because is taken literally—it must be the cause (Brewer, 1995, 242). Finally, an evolutionary argument (Jackson, 1982, 133): organisms typically inherit traits that enhance fitness, so, probably, mental events enhance fitness. If mental events lack causal efficacy, they do not enhance fitness. So, probably, mental events are causally efficacious. For these reasons, many think the principle of mental causation must be taken as a “truism” (Ney, 2007, 486), whose rejection would amount to “the end of the world” (Fodor, 1989, 77).
The second of the four principles constituting the causal exclusion problem is the principle of physical causal completeness:
The Principle of Physical Causal Completeness: every physical event that has a cause has a sufficient physical cause.
This principle is subject to several possible modifications. First, the principle of physical causal completeness is stated deterministically. If it turns out that the completed microphysics is indeterministic, it would be easy to reframe this principle in terms of a probabilistic model of microphysics. For example, every physical event has its probability fixed by entirely physical antecedents (Papineau, 1993, 22; Bennett, 2008, 281). Nothing of substance rides on adopting the deterministic or probabilistic version, but the deterministic reading is often used for the sake of simplicity. Second, this principle, as presently defined, merely stipulates that physical events have sufficient physical causes, but does not require that mental events have sufficient physical causes. Thus, it is possible that physical events have sufficient physical causes, but mental events do not. This possibility is ruled out by the addition of a strong supervenience principle, which, for the purposes of the mental causation debate, can be defined as follows:
The Principle of Supervenience: physical events determine every mental event, and every mental event depends upon physical events.
As a general example of supervenience, imagine a picture of Mona Lisa printed out by a dot-matrix printer. The Mona Lisa depends upon the dots on the page, and the dots on the page determine that the Mona Lisa arises. Likewise in the case of mental causation: Jennie’s desire for a peach is determined by, and dependent upon, some series of neural events in Jennie’s brain. The supervenience principle, combined with the principle of physical causal completeness, says that not only does every physical event have a sufficient physical cause, but every event, including mental events, is determined by physical events. This can serve as an adequate definition of physicalism:
Physicalism: every physical event has a sufficient physical cause, and every event is determined by, and depends upon, physical events.
Not only do many physicalists supplement the principle of physical causal completeness with a supervenience principle, but some also strengthen the principle of physical causal completeness into a principle of physical causal closure. The principle of physical causal closure indicates that physical events only have sufficient physical causes. On physical causal completness, distinct mental causes are not definitively barred from causally interacting with physical events (Kim, 2009, 38; Montero, 2003, 174). That is, one can admit that every physical event has a sufficient physical cause, while continuing to add a mental cause for the event as well (Marcus, 2005, 19ff; Crane and Mellor, 1990, 206). This possibility is closed off by stipulating that physical events only have physical causes (Vicente, 2006, 150; Kim, 2005, 50; Montero, 2003, 175). Most, however, do not endorse this stronger principle of physical causal closure, since it appears to exclude nonreductive physicalist models of mental causation (Kim, 2005, 52; Lowe, 2000, 572).
The principle of physical causal completness is supported by two arguments. First, the appeal to conservation laws. There are a number of sources that extensively discuss the historical ascension of conservation laws in modern physics (Harbecke, 2008, 19ff; Papineau, 2001, 13ff). In brief, Descartes introduced the law of the conservation of motion, according to which the total mass times speed of any set of bodies remains constant. Descartes maintained, however, that the mind could alter the direction of bodies without altering their speed. Leibniz however, established the law of the conservation of linear momentum, according to which the total mass times speed and direction of any set of bodies remains constant, regardless of how they interact. Leibniz argued that this conservation law closed the physical world off from mental causes. Several centuries later, Hermann von Helmholtz added the law of conservation of energy: the total energy, or force, of any system of interacting bodies is conserved, or, remains the same across time. The result of these conservation laws is that every physical event has a sufficient physical cause. Those endorsing physical causal closure also use this argument to yield the stronger conclusion that every physical event has only a sufficient physical cause, as distinct mental causes cannot add energy to a closed physical system. Physical causal completeness is also supported by the success of neuroscience. In the past one hundred years, neuroscientists have successfully mapped neuronal processes responsible for a wide range of behavioural effects. Brain regions associated with mental states such as emotions, cognitive capacities, and perceptual capacities have been discovered. While neuroscience is not yet complete, these findings provide increasingly compelling evidence that every behavioural effect has a sufficient physical cause. For these reasons, many think that the principle of physical causal completeness is “fully established” (Papineau, 2001, 33).
The third principle constituting the causal exclusion problem is the principle of irreducibility, according to which mental causes of behavioural effects are distinct from physical causes of behavioural effects.
The Principle of Irreducibility: mental causes of behaviour are distinct from physical causes of behaviour.
The principle of irreducibility, like the previous two principles, has different readings. Some take the principle of irreducibility to mean that mental properties are distinct from physical properties, though mental events are identical with physical events (Davidson, 1993, 3; Fodor, 1974, 100). That is, a brain event in Jennie’s brain has neural properties, such as its cascading neural activity, and distinct mental properties, such as a felt desire for a peach. On this view, mental causation typically occurs when the brain event, in virtue of its mental properties, causes behavioural effects. Others take the principle of irreducibility to mean that mental properties are distinct from physical properties, and mental events are distinct from physical events (Kim, 2005, 42). In this case, Jennie’s neural activity is a distinct event from her felt desire for a peach. On this view, mental causation typically occurs when the mental event causes behavioural effects. This distinction is central to a strategy for overcoming the causal exclusion problem, as discussed in Section 3.a.
There are two leading arguments in support of the principle of irreducibility. First, Leibniz’ doctrine of the indiscernibility of identicals stipulates that if two entities are identical they share all the same properties. Thus, a moose is not identical with a bear if the moose has antlers but the bear does not, and mental causes are not identical with physical causes if mental causes have distinct properties from physical causes. Some argue that mental events are subjective experiences such as itches or pains while physical events are objective chemical interactions (Chalmers, 1996). Others argue that mental events are purposive, intentional, and rational, while chemical activity in the brain is not (Silberstein, 2001, 85). Still others contrast free agency with physical determinism. The principle of irreducibility is also supported by the multiple realizability argument (Putnam, 1967), according to which mental properties can be realized by a number of different physical property instances. For instance, the same hunger for fish is realized by different neural activity in humans and sharks. Since a self-identical property must always be present wherever it is, hunger cannot be identical with a specific neural activity in humans, since hunger is also present where this specific neural property is absent. Some philosophers add that the same mental event can be multiply realized over time as well (Pereboom, 2002, 503). This way, Jennie’s belief that cheerios are yummy has persisted since she was three, despite slight alterations to the neural correlates constituting her belief over time. For these reasons, many take the failure of the principle of irreducibility to be “simply inconceivable” (Slors and Walter, 2002, 1), as evidenced by reductionists who acknowledge the “grip” of the “compelling intuition” (Papineau, 2002, 3).
The final principle constituting the causal exclusion problem is the principle of causal exclusion. In its contemporary formulation, the causal exclusion principle is introduced by Norman Malcolm (1968), but is most thoroughly exposited by Jaegwon Kim. Here is Kim’s articulation of the principle:
The Principle of Causal Exclusion: “No single event can have more than one sufficient cause occurring at any given time—unless it is a genuine case of causal overdetermination” (Kim, 2005, 42).
It is worth highlighting several important features of this definition. First, the causal exclusion principle comes with the caveat that an event can have more than one sufficient cause if the event is genuinely overdetermined. Genuine overdetermination occurs when two independent causal processes converge on the same effect—the house burns down because the lit match drops in the garbage at the same time as the lightning strikes the house. The nonreductive physicalist posits that mental events supervene on physical events, so there are not two independent causal processes, so behavioural effects are not genuine cases of overdetermination. As a result, the causal exclusion principle directly opposes the nonreductive physicalist view that behavioural effects can have sufficient physical causes and dependent mental causes.
The causal exclusion principle specifies that events cannot have more than one sufficient cause occurring at a given time. This caveat is added in order to set aside instances involving causal chains where a is a sufficient cause of b, and b is a sufficient cause of c, thereby indicating that a is also a sufficient cause of c. It is acceptable for c to have both a and b as sufficient causes in this way. But, since the nonreductive physicalist argues that mental events supervene on physical events, these events occur simultaneously, so the causal exclusion principle applies straightforwardly.
The causal exclusion principle can be interpreted as stating that behavioural events cannot have two sufficient causes (Arnadottir and Crane, 2013, 254). This interpretation allows for the following trivial solution to the causal exclusion problem: behavioural effects have one sufficient physical cause and a distinct but insufficient mental cause, which does not violate the causal exclusion principle. Indeed, the principle of mental causation does not stipulate that mental events must be sufficient causes, so this solution would be available. The alternative reading of the causal exclusion principle rules out this scenario by stating that behavioural events cannot have a single sufficient cause and any other cause, partial or sufficient (Kim, 2005, 17).
While the causal exclusion principle rules out more than a single sufficient cause of an effect, it does not rule out the possibility that the effect has a sufficient physical cause and a non-causal determinant. This is an especially poignant note, since physical events non-causally determine supervening mental events. Thus, the following trivial solutions to the causal exclusion problem are available: mental effects have sufficient mental causes, and are determined by subvening physical events (Thomasson, 1998, 183-186); physical effects have sufficient physical causes, and are determined by distinct mental events. These moves are repelled in two ways. First, by appealing to a broader principle of determinative exclusion, according to which effects can have no more than a single determinant, causal or otherwise (Kim, 2005, 17). Second, by appealing to Edward’s Dictum, which says sufficient synchronic determination relations exclude causal relations (Kim, 2005, 36ff). For example, the existence of a university at a time is what ultimately determines that Dr. Smith is a professor at the university at that time, not the fact that she got tenure two years ago. Similarly, subvening physical bases determine mental events, thereby excluding prior mental events as causes of those mental events.
There are four arguments in support of the causal exclusion principle. First, the massive coincidence argument: multiple sufficient causes of the same effect is a rare coincidence—barns infrequently burn down by the simultaneous occcurrence of a lightning strike and a dropped match. Yet, mental causation is ubiquitous—agents perform acts based on reasons hundreds of times a day and there are billions of agents in the world. Thus, the view that behavioural effects have more than a single sufficient cause is a view that stipulates massive amounts of coincidence, which is implausible (Kim, 1998, 53). Second, the parsimony argument: according to the venerable principle of parsimony, one ought not multiply causes beyond necessity, where necessity is eclipsed once sufficient causation is established (Kim, 1989, 98). Third, the necessity argument: overdetermining causes are individually sufficient, so not individually necessary. Billy and Suzy both throw stones, simultaneously breaking the window. Billy’s throw is individually sufficient—his throw alone, without Suzy’s, would have broken the window—so Suzy’s throw is individually unncessary. If behaviour is likewise overdetermined, neither cause is individually necessary. But, physical causal completeness insists that some physical cause is necessary, and mental causation requires a mental cause (Moore, 2017). Fourth, the additivity argument: if causation involves production, and one sufficient cause packs all the punch required to produce the effect, then a second cause would push the effect too far, or be incapable of producing the effect at all, on account of the fact that the effect has already been fully produced (Carey, 2011, 253; Kim, 1998, 53).
To briefly summarize, each of the four principles constituting the causal exclusion problem are substantially motivated. But, it is difficult to imagine how one can consistently endorse all four principles. How can one agree that behavioural effects can have no more causes than the single sufficient physical cause, while simultaneously arguing that behavioural effects nevertheless have distinct mental causes as well? The nonreductive physicalist endorses the first three principles, leaving the fourth principle as an objection to the nonreductive physicalist view. The next section canvasses a variety of resolutions to this causal exclusion problem.
Numerous responses to the causal exclusion problem have arisen. Some solutions modify the metaphysical foundations underlying the causal exclusion problem (3.a-3.b). Others propose models of nonreductive physicalism that secures mental causation (3.c-3.f). Still others reject one of the four principles constituting the causal exclusion problem (3.g-3.j).
The causal exclusion problem is grounded in a set of metaphysical assumption. Some critics undermine the causal exclusion problem by refuting or simply rejecting these metaphysical assumptions. One such strategy focuses on the nature of events and properties presumed by the causal excluion problem. Kim frames the causal exclusion principle in terms of events: no single event can have more than a single sufficient cause. Likewise, the principle of physical causal completness indicates that physical events have sufficient physical causes, while the principle of mental causation states that events sometimes have mental causes. Clearly, the nature of events is central to the causal exclusion problem.
Kim endorses the property exemplification model of events, according to which an event is the instantiation of a property by an object at a time (Kim, 1976). Sebastian’s stroll at noon, or Brutus’ stabbing at sunset, are prototypical events as are the brain’s neural process at dawn and Joe’s pain at dawn. While each event has one constitutive property, events can have other properties as well. Sebastian’s stroll at noon has the constitutive property of ‘being a stroll’, while it also has the properties of being long and winding. Events are identical if they have the same object, constitutive property, and time. Thus, Sebastian’s stroll at noon is identical with the man’s stroll at 12:00 PM, but is not identical with Grace’s stroll at noon, or with Sebastian’s sleep at noon, or with Sebastian’s stroll at sunset. These identity conditions on events entail that a mental event is only identical with a physical event if, among other things, the mental property of the event is identical with the physical property of the event (Kim, 2005, 42). This is called the single-instantiation thesis, and a number of authors agree with it (Whittle, 2007, 64; Gibb, 2004, 469). The implication is that one cannot yoke event identity with property dualism.
Cynthia MacDonald and Graham MacDonald modify the property exemplification model in a manner that opens up a solution to the causal exclusion problem (MacDonald and MacDonald, 2006). They note that the same event can be the instantiation of both a constitutive property and numerous other properties as well. Sebastian’s stroll is the same event as Sebastian’s walk at noon, and Sebastian’s moving at noon, and Sebastian’s exercising at noon. As they say, “there can be just one instance of distinct properties” (MacDonald and MacDonald, 2006, 562). This co-instantiation thesis, applied to the mental causation debate, suggests that the same event can be an instance of a physical property and a distinct mental property. Or, one can yoke event identity with property dualism. This affords the following solution to the causal exclusion problem: mental causes are identical with sufficient physical causes. This means there are not two sufficient causes, and mental properties cannot be reduced to physical properties.
This solution not only rests upon the successful modification of Kim’s framework, but also faces a version of the quausal problem (Honderich, 1982, 63-64; Sosa, 1984, 277; Kim, 1984, 267)). The quausal problem stipulates that events are caused by virtue of causally relevant properties. For example, while the heavy, green pear causes the scale to tip to one pound, it is in virtue of the pear’s heaviness that the scale tips to one pound, not in virtue of the pear’s greenness. Likewise, while the event causes behavioural effects, it is plausible that the event, by virtue of its constitutive physical properties, rather than its mental properties, causes behavioural events. MacDonald and MacDonald avoid the quausal problem by suggesting that events cause as ontological simples. That is, it assumes that the event that is a physical instance is the event that is a mental instance, and this event does not cause in virtue of it being a physical instance or mental instance, but it causes in virtue of being an event (MacDonald, 2007, 243). Some worry that this response would allow every property instanced as the event to be causally efficacious (Wyss, 2010, 174).
Donald Davidson goes a step further than MacDonald and MacDonald, rejecting the Kimian framework of events entirely (Davidson, 1980, 163ff). For Davidson, events are ontologically simple. Events are not instantiations of constitutive properties, nor do they have other properties as ontological constituents. Thus, the building’s falling at noon is not, essentially, a falling, so it can truly be re-described using non-equivalent language, such as ‘the event reported about on pg. 5 of the Times’, or ‘that fateful event’. Or, the neural process can be truly described using physical vocabulary or non-equivalent mental vocabulary, such as ‘Jennie’s desire for a peach’. This amounts to event identity: the mental event is the physical event, yoked together with conceptual dualism, and the physical description is irreducible to the mental description (Davidson, 1980, 207ff). This model solves the causal exclusion problem as follows: mental causes are identical with sufficient physical causes, so there are no more than a single sufficient cause, while mental predicates are irreducible to physical predicates.
Critics typically level the quausal problem against this Davidsonian solution (Honderich, 1982). Again, the quasal problem suggests that events cause in virtue of causally relevant properties: while the fleecy, pink slippers provide warmth, it is in virtue of their fleecyness, not their pinkness, that they provide warmth. Likewise, while mental causation may be secured by the fact that the mental event is the efficacious physical event, mental quausation fails by virtue of the fact that events cause in virtue of their lawlike physical properties, not in virtue of their mental properties. Davidson responds by stating that events cause as events, no matter whether the events are described in physical vocabulary or mental vocabulary (Davidson, 1993). Most philosophers are unsatisfied with Davidson’s response, as they find it plausible that events cause effects through causally relevant properties (Kim, 1993b).
The causal exclusion problem is, prima facie, a problem pertaining to causation. The principle of mental causation implies that there are mental causes, while the principle of physical causal completeness implies that there are physical causes that are sufficient causes. At the same time, the principle of causal exclusion stipulates that no effect can have more than a single sufficient cause. Questions about the nature of causation are paramount, and numerous solutions to the causal exclusion problem advert to modifying the metaphysics of causation upon which the problem rests.
Jaegwon Kim crafts the causal exclusion problem from within a productive model of causation, according to which “a cause is something that produces, or generates, or brings about its effects, something from which the effects derive their existence or occurrence” (Kim, 2007, 235). This means that causes push, pull, strike, transfer momentum or energy, or in some other way produce their effects. The additivity argument for the causal exclusion principle is largely motivated by the productive model of causation. If the physical cause packs all the punch required to produce the effect, then a distinct mental cause would push the effect further or harder or be incapable of producing the effect at all on account of the fact that the effect has already been fully produced.
Numerous philosophers undermine the causal exclusion problem by attacking this productive model of causation. They argue, for example, that productive notions of causation do not appear in contemporary physics (Loewer, 2007). Emboldened by these considerations, numerous critics resolve the causal exclusion problem by operating within different models of causation. For example, the nomological model of causation stipulates that causes nomologically necessitate their effects. Fire is a cause of smoke since there exists a law such that ‘if fire occurs, then smoke occurs’. On this view, mental events are causes of behavioural effects if there exists a law such that ‘if the mental event occurs, then the behavioural event occurs’. This law can be established, as the physical event, which necessitates the behavioural effect, also necessitates the occurrence of the mental event. So, all things being equal, the presence of the mental event necessitates the occurrence of the behavioural effect (Fodor, 1989, 66). Thus, behavioural effects can have nomologically sufficient physical causes and nomologically sufficient mental causes.
Critics level several objections at this nomological causation solution. First, the nomological model may fail as an account of causation. Numerous events stand in nomological relations with other events without being causes of those events (Kim, 2007, 231): the gun’s sound nomologically necessitates the hole in the wall, the knife’s shadow nomologically necessitates the gash in the screen. Similarly, mental events may be like shadows that nomologically necessitate without causing behavioural effects. One can object to this shadow analogy on the grounds that mental causation stipulates that mental events are efficacious whereas shadows are not. A more appropriate analogy may be where fire causes Joe’s death, but fire necessitates the appearance of smoke, which is clearly also a nomologically sufficient cause of Joe’s death. However, given that the causal exclusion principle stipulates that there cannot be two sufficient causes of behavioural effects, those committed to the causal exclusion principle will not allow two nomologically sufficient causes of behavioural effects.
Some philosophers resolve the causal exclusion problem by appealing to a counterfactual model of causation. According to the counterfactual model, effects are counterfactually dependent on their causes. Fire is a cause of smoke since there is a counterfactual dependency such that ‘Had the fire not occurred, the smoke would not have occurred’ (Lewis, 1986, 166-167). Counterfactual dependency is established if the nearest possible world where fire does not occur is also a world where smoke does not occur. On this view, mental events are causes of behavioural effects if the nearest possible world where the mental event is absent is a world where the behavioural effect is absent as well. This counterfactual dependency is established by virtue of the fact that the nearest possible world where the mental event does not occur is also, given supervenience, a world where the subvening physical event does not occur, which indicates the behavioural effect does not occur either (Loewer, 2007; Kroedel, 2015).
This accounts for mental causation, but establishing the truth of physical causal completness is more complex on the counterfactual account. Some demonstrate that the behavioural event has a physical cause by appealing to the truth of the counterfactual ‘Had the physical event not occurred, the behavioural effect would not have occurred’ (Loewer, 2002). While this establishes that behavioural effects have physical causes, physical causal completeness requires that behavioural effects have sufficient physical causes. Unfortunately, the counterfactual model lacks a clear criterion for sufficient causation. Here is one possibility: the physical event is a sufficient cause of the behavioural effect if the nearest possible world where the physical event occurs without the mental event is a world where the behavioural effect occurs. The difficulty with this possibility is that nonreductive physicalists typically say that the physical event metaphysically necessitates the mental event, so there are no worlds where only the physical event occurs (Loewer 2002, 658; Bennett 2003, 479; Kallestrup, 2006, 472), so it is not established that the physical event is a sufficient cause. Perhaps this difficulty is avoided by saying that the physical event is a sufficient physical cause of the behavioural effect if the nearest possible worlds where the physical event occurs are also worlds where the behavioural effect occurs (Menzies, 2013, 63; Kroedel, 2015, 366).
The counterfactualist solution to the causal exclusion problem faces additional difficulties as well. Like the difficulty facing nomological accounts, some complain that counterfactual dependency is established among non-causal events: had the knife’s shadow not occurred, the wound would not have occurred, but the shadow is not a cause of the wound; had the gun’s sound not occurred, the hole in the wall would not have occurred, though the sound is not a cause of the hole (Kim, 2007, 234). Similarly, mental events may be like shadows that behaviour counterfactually depends upon, but nevertheless makes no causal contribution.
Some philosophers have recently deployed a difference-making model of causation to solve the causal exclusion problem (List and Menzies, 2009, 482). The difference-making model, which bares similarities with a blend of the nomological account and the counterfactual account, says that causes must ‘make a difference’ for their effects. The fire makes a difference for the smoke if ‘Had the fire occurred, the smoke would have occurred’ is true, and if ‘Had the fire not occurred, the smoke would not have occurred’ is true. Mental events cause behavioural effects, since ‘Had the mental event occurred, the behaviour would have occurred’ and ‘Had the mental event not occurred, the behaviour would not have occurred’ are both true. Physical events are sufficient causes of behavioural effects, because ‘Had the physical event occurred, the behaviour would have occurred’ is true. But ‘Had the physical event not occurred, the behaviour would not have occurred’ is false, because the mental event could have a different physical realizer, in which case the behaviour would still have occurred. So, the physical event is a sufficient cause, securing physical causal completeness; meanwhile, the behaviour has no more causes than the distinct mental cause, which satisfies the causal exclusion principle while sustaining distinct mental causes of behaviour.
Critics level several objections at this difference-making solution. First, since the physical event is not a cause of the behaviour, physical causal completeness may fail (Bermudez and Cahen, 2015, 53). While some take this issue to defeat the model, others take it to be a virtue of the model, since it turns the causal exclusion problem on its head by establishing that mental causes exclude physical causes of behavioural effects (Menzies, 2015, 39-40). It is also possible to avoid the failure of physical causal completness by arguing that behavioural effects are realization-sensitive. That is, if the occurrence of a different physical realizer yields a different behavioural effect, then the nearest worlds where the physical event does not occur are worlds where the behavioural effect does not occur. This establishes that the physical event is a cause of the behavioural effect. But, this solution now violates the causal exclusion principle, as it postulates more than a single sufficient cause of the behaviour.
Some philosophers appeal to the related interventionist model of causation to solve the causal exclusion problem (Woodward, 2003). On interventionism, fire is a cause of smoke if we intervene on fire, or, bring it about that fire does or does not happen, while holding all other variables constant, and the result is that the smoke does or does not happen. On this view, mental events are causes, since, when one intervenes on the mental event, the behavioural event shifts. For example, changing a mental event from a belief that carrots are healthy to a belief that carrots are poisonous would eliminate carrot eating behaviour. Likewise, the physical event is a cause of the behaviour, since taking the physical event away would take the behavioural effect away. The result: the interventionist model articulates a manner in which behavioural effects legitimately have more than a single sufficient cause, thereby falsifying the principle of causal exclusion.
Some resist this interventionist solution to the causal exclusion problem on the grounds that it is impossible to establish mental causation on interventionism. Interventionist mental causation requires intervening on the mental event while holding all other events, including the subvening physical event, fixed. But, by virtue of supervenience, it is impossible to intervene on the mental event without also altering the subvening physical event, so interventionist mental causation is not established (Baumgartner, 2010). Some respond by stipulating that the special nature of the supervenience relation entails that one need not – since one can not – hold the physical event fixed while intervening on the mental event. As such, there is no difficulty establishing mental causation within an interventionist framework (Woodward, 2015).
The most longstanding model of nonreductive physicalist mental causation is mind-body supervenience. According to this view, mental events supervene upon, or are determined by, physical events. This notion of supervenience implies a tight enough dependency relation for mental events to inherit the efficacy of their subvening bases. For example, Jennie’s desire for a peach causes her to eat a peach, while the subvening physical cause also causes her to eat the peach (Zangwill, 1996). It is worth noting that Kim once appealed to the supervenience relation to secure mental causation (Kim, 1993, 106). It is common to depict the situation with the aid of the following diagram, where m stands for a mental cause, p is a physical cause, m* is a mental effect, p* is a physical effect, horizontal and diagonal lines indicate causation, while vertical lines indicate supervenience:
Diagram 1: Supervenient Mental Causation
According to this diagram, p is a sufficient cause of p*, but p necessitates the presence of m, ensuring that m is present to cause p* and m* as well.
The causal exclusion principle is fashioned to directly confront this supervenience model of mental causation. Indeed, sometimes the causal exclusion problem is called the supervenience argument, indicating that supervenience based solutions are clear targets of the causal exclusion principle. The causal exclusion principle stipulates that events cannot have more than a single sufficient cause, where p* has two causal arrows converging on it, so one of the causes must be excluded. The principle of physical causal completeness stipulates that p must be a sufficient physical cause of p*, so m is excluded as a cause. Furthermore, m* is fully determined by its supervenience base p*, so m is excluded as a cause of m* (Kim, 2005, 39ff). There is no work for the mental event to do, which undermines the principle of mental causation, thereby calling supervenience-based nonreductive physicalism into question.
The difficulties associated with the supervenience solution led many philosophers to explore fresh methods of accommodating a sufficient physical cause and a distinct mental cause of the same effect. Chief among these new methods is renewed interest in the doctrine of emergentism (O’Connor and Wong, 2005; Humphreys, 1997). Emergentists argue that novel properties emerge, or arise, out of a base level. At the base level, microphysical particles arrange in such a way as to compose, and give rise to, higher level mereological wholes such as molecules or molecular compounds. The molecule has novel properties, or, properties that its particles, in isolation, lack. Molecules then arrange in such a way as to compose higher level biological wholes such as cells, hearts, reproductive mechanism, and organisms. These biological wholes have novel properties as well, such as the ability to pump an organism’s blood, to reproduce or to chew. Similarly, some biological wholes, specifically, brains, give rise to persons with novel mental properties such as beliefs and desires. And, persons, when appropriately grouped together, compose social structures and institutions with novel properties that the persons, in isolation, lack—for example, being a university professor, or being the baseball team’s shortstop.
Higher level emergent properties are capable of downward causation, which means that emergent properties influence lower level domains. Thus, the puppy-wise organization of bones and muscles influences these bones and muscles—if the bone was not arranged as a puppy jaw, the bone would not be able to bite down or move. Emergent properties secure mental causation by exercising downward efficacy on lower-level behaviours. The emergentist conceives of mental properties as emergent properties that arise out of, and are not reducible to, its neural parts. Hence, the principle of irreducibility is secured. At the same time, emergent mental properties arise out of, and are dependent upon, lower level physical properties, which may establish the physicalist view that all events are dependent upon physical events.
It is common to object to the emergentist solution to the mental causation problem on the grounds that emergent properties supervene upon their bases. This is problematic because, as discussed above, supervenient properties are susceptible to exclusion pressures. In other words, since the lower level bases are sufficient causes of behavioural effects, supervening emergent properties are excluded from causing behavioural effects (Kim, 1999; McLaughlin, 1997, 16).
Some emergentists respond by rejecting the view that emergent properties are supervenient properties, hence rejecting the view that the same exclusion pressures facing supervenient properties face emergent properties (Silberstein and McGeever, 1999). Other emergentists concede that emergent properties lack downward causation. They endorse what is sometimes called weak emergentism, or epistemic emergentism, according to which higher level descriptions cannot be explained by, and are not predictable from, lower level descriptions of the same phenomenon (Bedau, 1997). This view bares certain affinities with conceptual dualism yoked with ontological monism. Other emergentists respond by abandoning, or significantly nuancing, the principle of physical causal completeness (Hendry, 2010). Because emergent properties have novel, downward causal influence on behaviour, the lower level parts must not be sufficient causes of behaviour. However, higher level wholes, such as persons, rabbits, and mountains, are still broadly physical (Kim, 1997, 293), so higher level causes are still broadly physical causes. Thus, behavioural effects have sufficient physical causes, where sufficient physical causes includes both the lower level microphysical processes and the higher level broadly physical processes. This position, while it may secure a principle of broad physical causal completeness, seems to abandon microphysical causal completeness.
Functionalism is a dominant model of nonreductive physicalist mental causation that construes mental properties as functional properties of the mind (Witmer, 2003; Block, 1990). Jennie’s belief that it will rain is defined as her being in whatever state is caused by rain-indicating perceptual inputs and, given a background psychology that is familiar with rain, causes her rain preparation behaviour. These functional properties in turn have various physical realizers which carry out the specific task defined by the causal role. Jennie’s belief that it will rain is realized by some neural structure in her brain. Functionalism secures irreducibility and mental causation by defining mental events by their causal profiles, which are distinct from their physical realizers which implement the causal profile and cause behaviour.
The causal exclusion problem poses difficulties for this functionalist model of mental causation. Since, according to physical causal completeness, the physical realizer does all the work in bringing about behavioural effects, the mental state as defined by an abstract causal role is excluded from efficacy (Block, 1990, 155; Kim, 1998, 51). For example, the pill’s functional property of ‘being dormitive’ is realized by some chemical property of the pill, where the chemical does all the work in producing sleep in patients, leaving the dormitivity of the pill with no work left to do.
Functionalists respond to the causal exclusion problem in several ways. Some functionalists, including Kim, endorse realizer functionalism, which is the view that functional states are identical with their efficacious realizers, thereby inheriting the causal efficacy of their physical realizers. Thus, Jennie’s belief that it will rain is identical to the specific neural structure in her brain that realizes the functional role specified as the belief. This view secures mental causation via ontological reductionism, while it typically also endorses property dualism. For example, while the dormitive properties of one pill is secobarbital, the dormitive properties of another pill is phenobarbital, though not all dormitivity is realized by secobarbital. This functional reductionist position will be discussed in Section 3.i. Other functionalists endorse role functionalism, which is the view that functional states are distinct from their efficacious realizers. These functionalists must explain how functional properties play a role over and above the role played by their realizers. One currently viable possibility is the realization approach, as detailed in Section 3.f.
The realization strategy agrees with the functionalist view that mental properties are realized by physical properties. They add, however, that the causal powers associated with the realized mental property are distinct from the causal powers associated with the realizing physical property. Typically, the causal powers associated with the mental property are taken to be a proper subset of the causal powers associated with the physical property (Shoemaker, 2011; Wilson, 2011). For example, the causal powers associated with pain include the disposition to produce winces and groans, while the causal powers associated with pain’s realizer, C-Fibre firing, includes the disposition to produces winces and groans as well as other capabilities, such as the disposition to slightly tip sensitive scales and the disposition to nourish hungry lions. This model preserves irreducibility, since the causal powers associated with the mental property are more limited than, and hence distinct from, the causal powers of the physical property. This model secures mental causation by noting that it is the causal powers associated with the mental property that is causally efficacious in bringing about the behavioural effect. This model secures physical causal completeness since the mental property is realized by, hence is nothing over and above, the physical property instance that causes the effect. And, this solution does not violate the causal exclusion principle, as parts do not compete with their wholes for causal efficacy—a salvo of shots fired at Smith does not exclude the single arrow in that salvo that strikes Smith as a cause of Smith’s death (Shoemaker, 2007, 64).
The realization strategy faces several difficulties. Of central concern is whether tightly related but distinct tokens compete for causal efficacy. The suggestion is that the mereological relation is so tight that exclusion pressures do not arise. This is similar to the view that the supervenience relation is so tight that exclusion pressures do not arise. In Section 3.j., the compatibilist will similarly argue that the exceeding tightness of the relation dodges exclusion pressures. As discussed in the case of supervenience, however, the advocate of the causal exclusion principle will not be convinced that exclusion pressures are avoided in these cases. A second worry with the realization strategy is whether tokens realize both that subset of causal powers that is the mental property and the complete set of causal powers that is the physical properties. If the causal powers associated with pain includes the disposition to produce winces, and the causal powers associated with C-Fibre firing includes many things including the disposition to produce winces, and both of these causal powers are realized in the same instance, there seems to be a double counting of causal powers (Audi, 2012, 661). This double counting problem seems to re-introduce worries about overdetermination. It is possible to avoid this difficulty by positing token identity with property irreducibility (Wilson, 2011). That is, while mental properties are distinct from physical properties by virtue of their distinct causal profiles, realized mental properties are identical with their realizing physical instances. This move, however, like realizer functionalism, salvages mental causation at the price of abandoning token irreducibility. A third worry is that Shoemaker’s solution takes mental properties to be parts of physical causes of behavioural effects. Since wholes depend on their parts, physical causes of behavioural effects would be dependent upon mental properties, which may not be consistent with physicalism (Pineda and Vicente, 2017).
The epiphenomenalist resolves the causal exclusion problem by abandoning the principle of mental causation while endorsing the principles of physical causal completeness, irreducibility, and causal exclusion. Thus, effects can have only their sufficient physical causes, leading to the view that distinct mental events are not causally efficacious (Robinson, 2006; Gadenne, 2006). A common argument in support of epiphenomenalism is the joint strength of the principles of physical causal completeness, irreducibility, and causal exclusion, which together imply that mental causation fails.
The challenge for the epiphenomenalist is to overcome the argumentation supporting the principle of mental causation. They typically do this in two ways. First, they argue that, due to supervenience, the physical cause of behavioural effects necessitates the presence of a mental event as well. Thus, while mental events are not causal, they necessarily precede behavioural effects (Robinson, 2004, 165). Jennie’s eating of the peach is preceded by her desire for a peach, even though her desire is not a cause of her eating. This is a non-causal account of the common sense fact that the appropriate mental event precedes behavioural effects. Critics typically point out that epiphenomenalists do not think the physical event metaphysically necessitates the mental event. This makes it possible for the physical cause of Jennie’s peach eating to have given rise to a desire for broccoli instead, thereby breaking the link between the mental event and the appropriate behavioural response (Pauen, 2006).
Some endorse a weakened version of epiphenomenalism called the autonomy solution. While epiphenomenalism states that mental events lack causal efficacy tout court, the autonomy solution states that mental events do not causally interact with physical events, but do causally interact with mental effects (Gibbons, 2006). Jennie’s desire for a peach does not cause her to eat peaches but does cause her to believe she desires a peach. This move secures physical causal completeness and irreducibility while simultaneously establishing that behavioural effects are not overdetermined, and that mental events can cause mental effects. Critics argue that this solution leads to the unfortunate result that Jennie’s pain causes her to believe she is about to scream but does not cause her to actually scream (Dennett, 1991, 403). This drawback may be avoided by endorsing a wider autonomist solution, according to which mental events cause both mental effects and behavioural effects, but do not cause microphysical effects (Zhong, 2014, 349-350). This solution, however, like all autonomist solutions, faces worries that subvening microphysical processes determine behavioural effects and mental effects, thereby excluding mental events from causing mental effects or behavioural effects (Kim, 2005, 36-37).
The interactionist dualist solves the causal exclusion problem by accepting the principles of mental causation, irreducibility and causal exclusion, which jointly leads to the falsity of the principle of physical causal completeness. Because distinct mental events cause behavioural effects and behavioural effects are not overdetermined, the physical cause of the behaviour is not a sufficient cause (White, 2017; Meixner, 2008). Again, the plausibility of the three endorsed principles provides support for the conclusion that physical causal completeness is false.
This model must overcome the arguments in support of physical causal completeness. Some do so by providing models according to which mental causation is ‘invisible.’ This means that while mental events are causally efficacious, the efficacy of mental events is not detectable at the physical level (Lowe, 2008, 74; Gibb, 2015). One will not find gaps in the physical causal process that mental events must fill in, so behavioural effects have sufficient physical causes, so physical causal completeness is true. While this solution may not violate physical causal completeness, it does violate physical causal closure, as physical effects do not have only physical causes. This solution also faces exclusion pressures—the behavioural effect has a sufficient physical cause, thereby excluding purported distinct mental causes.
The reductionist solves the causal exclusion problem by rejecting the principle of irreducibility, leaving them open to embrace the principles of mental causation, physical causal completeness, and causal exclusion (Kim, 2005, 101). Thus, mental causes are identical with sufficient causes of behavioural effects, thereby establishing that behaviour has no more than a single sufficient cause. It is common to argue in support of reductionism by appeal to the joint strength of the other three principles: because behaviour cannot have more causes than the sufficient physical cause, the only way for mental causation to be true is to identify mental events with physical events.
The challenge is to demonstrate how the identity can be sustained, given the distinctions between mental and physical events, and the multiple realizability of the mental. Reductionists typically argue that the appearance of distinction is explained by the fact that the same event can be known by direct qualitative experience and by third-person description. Kim avoids the multiple realizability issue by emphasizing event reductionism: Jennie’s hunger is identical to an increase in a specific type of ghrelin in her gastrointestinal tract, while the shark’s hunger is identical with some other physiological state. While some supplement event reductionism with property dualism, this move is unavailable to Kim since event identity implies property identity on his model of events. Kim concludes that the property of hunger exists only as a functional concept (Kim, 2010, 207ff). The increase of a specific type of ghrelin in Jennie’s gastrointestinal tract is actually an instance of the property of being an increase of a specific type of ghrelin, and this event can be truly described using the functional concept of hunger as well. Critics worry that this view amounts to ontological monism yoked with conceptual dualism, which is troublesome because Kim has previously argued against the Davidsonian model of event identity with conceptual dualism (Moore and Campbell, 2015). It also seems that events must cause in virtue of their physical properties, not in virtue of their mental properties, since mental properties do not exist, so mental quausation fails.
Compatibilism, as coined by Terence Horgan (1997, 166), is the view that endorses the principles of mental causation, irreducibility, and physical causal completeness, thereby disputing the causal exclusion principle in some manner (Bennett, 2003; Shoemaker, 2007). Thus, there is some benign way of showing how behavioural effects can have sufficient physical causes and distinct mental causes. Support for compatibilism arises from the plausibility of the three endorsed principles, which constitutes evidence that the causal exclusion principle is false. Compatibilists argue that that there obtains an exceedingly tight relation between the physical cause and mental cause. As discussed in previous sections the exceedingly tight relation may be a relation of strong supervenience, or realization, or some other such relation in which the physical cause metaphysically necessitates the mental cause. As it is impossible for blue to occur without a colour occurring, and it is impossible for a horse-wise arrangement of horse parts to occur without a horse occurring, so it is impossible for the physical cause to occur without the mental cause.
This exceedingly tight relation is deployed as a resolution to the arguments supporting the causal exclusion principle. The massive coincidence involved with two independent causal processes converging on the same effect is replaced with the requirement that physical causes and their dependent mental causes must converge on behavioural effects (Loewer, 2002, 658). This tight relation implies that the physical cause necessitates the mental cause, so mental events are necessary for behavioural effects, overcoming the necessity argument. Likewise, the mental event guarantees the presence of some physical cause, so physical causes are necessary for behavioural effects (Kallestrup 2006, 472; Arnadottir and Crane 2013, 255), overcoming the necessity argument as well. Similarly, the parsimony argument stipulates one should not countenance more causes than necessary, but both the physical cause and the mental cause is necessary.
The compatibilist view faces a number of difficulties. Some worry that the compatibilist solution is ad hoc as the only instances of dependent overdetermination in nature appear to be those very instances of mental and physical dependent overdetermination that compatibilists suggest (Pineda, 2002). Compatibilists reply that ubiquitous, naturally occurring part-whole relations are also dependently overdetermined (Arnadottir and Crane, 2013, 258). The boxer’s knuckles and fist both strike the punching bag, simultaneously causing the punching bag to move; the baseball and the baseball’s parts both cause the window to shatter. Secondly, while compatibilists argue that exclusion pressures dissipate once the dependency relation between physical events and mental events is established, critics argue that the exclusion principle precisely applies to only those situations in which there are two dependent causes of the same effect (Kim, 2005, 48). Moreover, while compatibilism establishes that mental events are necessarily present prior to behavioural effects, it is not clear that the mental event is a cause of the behavioural effect. It is possible, for example, that the mental event is like a necessarily present epiphenomenal shadow that does no causal work. This leaves the sufficient physical cause as the single sufficient cause of the behavioural effect. Compatibilists reply by stating that the mental event is not akin to an epiphenomenal shadow, but rather is a cause of the effect. However, the more the compatibilist insists that the behavioural effect necessarily has a mental cause, the more difficult it is to show that the physical cause is an individually sufficient cause of the effect (Moore, 2017, 36).
The causal exclusion principle has a “companion principle” (Kim, 2005, 17) in the realm of explanation called the principle of explanatory exclusion. The principle of explanatory exclusion states: “There can be no more than a single complete and independent explanation for any one event” (Kim, 1988, 233). In fact, it is of historical worth to note that Kim’s inaugural articulation of the exclusion problem occurs in the context of excluding superfluous explanations (Kim, 1988; Kim, 1989). It is important to note that the principle of explanatory exclusion allows for dependent explanations in excess of the complete explanation of the same event, while causal exclusion specifically bans dependent causes in excess of the sufficient cause of the same event. The viability of this dissimilarity is questionable: if distinct but dependent explanations of the same event are permissible, why are distinct but dependent causes of the same event not permissible? Or, if distinct but dependent causes of the same event are not permissible, why are distinct but dependent explanations of the same event permitted?
Like the causal exclusion principle, the explanatory exclusion principle is supported by a parsimony argument (Kim, 1989, 98): explanations should not be multiplied beyond necessity, where one complete explanation of an event is necessary, so additional independent explanations of the same event can be excluded. The explanatory exclusion principle is also supported by appeal to explanatory realism, which says that explanations track objective relations and that these objective relations are the content of explanations (Kim, 1988, 226). Because there can be no more than a single sufficient cause of events, and explanations track objective relations, there can be no more than a single complete and independent explanation of events.
The explanatory exclusion principle poses problems for models claiming that the same event has a complete physical explanation and an independent mental explanation, which includes the popular model of ontological monism yoked with conceptual dualism (Davidson, 1993; Papineau, 2002). Jennie’s increased heart rate has a complete physical explanation in terms of a release of hormones from her amygdala, but this same event is also explained by her fear of the approaching bear. Since the physical explanation is a complete explanation, the intensionally independent mental explanation can be excluded as unnecessary—an unpalatable result.
Numerous responses to this explanatory exclusion problem have been proposed. First, some reduce mental explanations to physical explanations by endorsing an extensionalist model of explanatory individuation (Kim, 1988, 233). The physical explanation of Jennie’s increased heart rate refers to the same causal relation as the mental explanation of Jennie’s increased heart rate. And, the causal relation is the content of both explanations; therefore, the explanations state the same thing, so there is really only one explanation. Explanatory exclusion pressures only arise when there are two explanations of the same event, so explanatory exclusion pressures do not arise. This response is accused of endorsing a counterintuitive model of explanatory individuation, whereby two clearly distinct explanations are considered the same explanation. For example, ‘The earthquake caused the collapse of the building’ does not seem to state the same explanation as ‘The event that caused the collapse caused the collapse of the building’, since one is explanatory, and the other is not (Marras, 1998).
Nonreductive physicalists typically solve the explanatory exclusion problem in one of two ways. First, as discussed, the explanatory exclusion principle allows for two explanations of the same event, so long as the explanations are not independent. Thus, if the mental explanation is dependent upon the distinct complete physical explanation, then explanatory exclusion pressure need not arise. Plausibly, mental explanations are dependent upon physical explanations by virtue of the fact that the mental ontologically supervenes upon the physical (Melnyk, 1996). Thus, ‘Jennie’s fear explains her increased heart rate’ is a distinct but ontologically dependent explanation of the same causal relation that is explained by ‘hormone release from her amygdala explains her increased heart rate’. This solution bares certain similarities with the compatibilist solution to the causal exclusion problem, which itself posits distinct but dependent mental causes of the same behavioural effects. Likewise, it is open to the charge that distinct but dependent mental explanations can be excluded on account of the fact that behavioural effects have a complete physical explanation.
Second, rather than attempting to resolve the explanatory exclusion problem, many nonreductive physicalists dismiss the explanatory exclusion principle as a needlessly stringent constraint on explanation. They argue that there is no difficulty with describing the same event in multiple ways (Arnadottir and Crane, 2013, 256). The red rose can be re-described as the red-or-green rose, which can be re-described as the red flower, which can be re-described as the apple coloured rose, etc. Similarly, the same causal relation between events can be described in microphysical terms, neuroscientific terms, or psychological terms, so mental explanations need not be excluded. This solution relies upon acceptance of the contestable view that the value of parsimony does not apply to explanation. Moreover, even if it is true that behavioural events can have physical and mental explanations, it is worrisome that behavioural events need not have mental explanations, given that they already have complete physical explanations.
To this point, the causal exclusion problem has been restricted to the domain of mental causation, so only mental events have been in danger of being excluded from causal efficacy. Numerous philosophers worry, however, that the causal exclusion problem might generalize. That is, if mental causes are excluded by the sufficiency of subvening neural causes of behavioural effects, then perhaps neural causes are excluded by the sufficiency of the subvening chemical causes of behavioural effects. These behavioural effects are, in turn, excluded by the sufficiency of the subvening microphysical causes of behavioural effects (Kim, 1997; Burge, 1993, 102). This generalization problem leads to the following two problems. First, not only are mental causes threatened by the causal exclusion problem, but the causal efficacy of all special science properties is now threatened. Second, if there is no bottom level to physics, then all causal efficacy may drain away, since microphysical causation would be excluded by lower level quantum processes, which would in turn be excluded by lower level processes, and so on and so forth (Block, 2003; Walter, 2008). These problems are so severe that they are sometimes treated as reductio ad absurdum arguments against the causal exclusion problem.
Kim’s initial response to the generalization problem is that the causal exclusion problem does not generalize, since the exclusion engendering relations holding between mental and physical events is dissimilar to the relations holding between special science entities. The relation between the mental and the physical is a relation between higher order properties and lower order properties, where both of these properties are instantiated by the same substance. In this case, exclusion pressures arise, as the lower order properties of the substance do all the work, excluding the efficacy of other properties of the substance. On the contrary, the relation between special science properties and their bases is a relation between higher level structural properties of a whole and properties of lower level parts, where these properties are instantiated by different substances. Properties instantiated in different substances need not causally compete—the 10kg weight of the table causes the scale to tip to 10kg, and the table’s weight is not excluded by the 6kg weight of the top and the 4kg weight of the pedestal, since neither of those parts can make the scale tip to 10kg.
Numerous critics reject this response to the generalization problem (Block 2003; Noordhof, 1999). Of central concern is that higher level structural properties are supervenient upon the properties and relations of the lower level parts taken together. The combined properties and relations of the lower level parts is a sufficient cause of whichever effect occurs, thereby excluding supervening higher level structural properties of wholes. The 10kg weight of the table is excluded from causing the scale to tip to 10kg by the combined weight of the pedestal and top. After all, the scale does not tip to 20kg when the pedestal and top, and the table as well, sit upon it.
There are two other replies to the generalization problem that are worth discussing. First, the reductionist response claims that the structural property of the higher level whole is identical to the properties and relations of the lower level parts. Since the higher level structural property is identical with the causally efficacious lower level state of affairs, the higher level structural property is causally efficacious (Kim, 2005, 69). And, because the identity between higher level structural properties and lower level states of affairs holds all the way down the mereological scale, there is no fear of causal powers draining away to a bottomless level (Kim, 2005, 68).
There are several considerations weighing against this reductive solution to the generalization problem. First, the higher level structural property is singular while the lower level properties of, and relations among, the parts is a plurality. A water molecule, for example, is singular. The hydrogen atom, the oxygen atom, the other hydrogen atom, and the binary bonding relations holding between individual atoms are a plurality. It is difficult to see how a singularity can be identical with a plurality (Moore, 2010). Second, higher level wholes are multiply composable (Block, 2003, 145). For example, the same bicycle can have a Mavik tire or a Michelin tire functioning as its front wheel. If, however, the bicycle is identical to its lower level parts and relations, which includes the Mavik tire, and then the Mavik tire is replaced by a Michelin tire, then the bicycle is not the same bicycle after this alteration. This discussion not only intersects with debates in the philosophy of science, but also interacts with longstanding debates in mereology, such as the questions of mereological essentialism and whether composition is identity.
It is also possible to adopt a nonreductivist response to the generalization problem, according to which higher level structures are distinct from their lower level parts and relations. This response bares affinity with the emergentist response to the causal exclusion problem. The task of the nonreductivist is to demonstrate how higher level structures have causal powers above and beyond the causal powers of the parts and their relations. To this end, it is uncontroversial that structure is efficacious. For example, fructose and sucrose are isomers, both composed of C6H12O6. The fundamental elements are the same, and they have the same properties. Fructose and sucrose, however, are structured differently, and so they have different properties. Fructose is sweeter than sucrose, and causes less insulin secretion in humans than sucrose, for example. So, plausibly, higher level structure provides novel efficacy. The question is whether the lower level parts of fructose, with their properties, in their specific relations, are sufficient causes for these effects. If they are not, then nonreduced higher level structure has novel causal powers, but the completeness of the lower level physical level is questioned. If they are, then the completeness of the lower level physical level is established, but the efficacy of the higher level structure may be excluded.
While no solution to the causal exclusion problem has enjoyed widespread acclaim, there are several flourishing avenues of response. Chief among them are the compatibilist response, and appeals to differing models of causation, though discussion in other areas is ongoing as well. The causal exclusion problem, however, has a manner of re-establishing itself after it seems to have been solved. So, it is unlikely that the problem will dissipate in the short term. It is clear, however, that the overriding aspiriation of philosophers is to find a nonreductive, physicalist solution to the causal exclusion problem as few follow Kim’s reductive conclusions.
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