Canonized a Catholic saint in 1767, Jeanne de Chantal (Jane of Chantal) has rarely been the object of philosophical analysis. Until recently, her influence has largely confined itself to the Visitation order she founded and to the network of schools sponsored by the Visitation nuns. Contemporary theologians, however, have studied her works from the perspective of spirituality. Her extensive writings provide an elaborate map of the soul’s journey toward perfection; they also indicate the charismatic authority of women in the ministry of spiritual direction and moral counsel during the era. De Chantal’s lectures, conferences, and letters merit philosophical attention inasmuch as they constitute an early modern chapter in moral psychology. Their ascetical concept of moral virtue and their mystical account of the soul reflect a theory of human nature embedded in the convent culture of the Counter-Reformation in France. Destined for a convent audience, her commentaries on the writings of Saint Augustine constitute a gendered Augustinianism adapted to the needs of an exclusively female public.
Born on January 23, 1572 in Dijon, Jeanne-Françoise Frémyot belonged to a prominent Burgundian family of lawyers. Her father, Bénigne Frémyot, was the president of the Parliament of Burgundy and a leader of the royalist party. Her mother, Marguerite de Berbisey, a descendant of the family of St. Bernard of Clairvaux, died when Jeanne-Françoise was only eighteen months old. Her widowed father then married Claire Jousset, who is believed to have died shortly after the marriage.
Educated at home, Jeanne-Françoise studied reading, writing, music, and dancing. She excelled in embroidery; throughout her life she would be renowned for her needlework. Her father personally supervised her study of history, morals, and religion.
On December 29, 1592, Jeanne-Françoise married Christophe II de Rabutin, baron de Chantal. Residing at his ancestral castle of Bourbilly, Madame de Chantal soon revealed her skill as an administrator by reforming the economics and work habits of the dilapidated estate. She also gained a saintly reputation for her work among the sick and the poor, especially during the region’s times of famine. She bore six children, three of whom survived into adulthood: Celse-Bégnine (1596-1633), Marie-Aimée (1598-1617), and Françoise (1599-1684). Her husband died as the result of a hunting accident in 1601. During her prolonged period of mourning, Madame de Chantal made a private vow to God that she would remain celibate during the remainder of her life and that, once her children were sufficiently old, she would devote herself to works of charity.
In 1604, De Chantal’s spiritual life reached a turning point. She met François de Sales, the bishop of Geneva who was living in exile in Annecy, due to Calvinist opposition. He delivered a series of Lenten sermons in Dijon. Agreeing to serve as her spiritual director, De Sales introduced the widow to his own spirituality, most notably expressed in his Introduction to the Devout Life. He also introduced her to his more philosophical works. Drawing from Thomas Aquinas and Teresa of Avila, his Treatise on the Love of God provided an extensive Augustinian presentation of God’s attributes, the nature of the soul, and the virtues essential for the ascetical and mystical life. In their correspondence De Sales shared with De Chantal extracts from the treatise in progress.
In 1610, believing that she was free to leave her adolescent children in the care of others, De Chantal left her home to join François de Sales in Annecy. Her eldest child, Celeste-Bégnine, the future father of Madame de Sévigné, would long resent what he considered an unjustified abandonment. In the same year, she founded a new female religious order, the Visitation of Holy Mary, with De Sales. The new order was to differ from current religious orders in several details. The nuns were not to be cloistered. They would make simple rather than solemn vows. They would wear the simple clothes of the poor rather than religious habits. They would regularly leave the convent to minister to the poor, the sick, and the elderly in their homes. The order’s rule of life would be comparatively gentle, proper for candidates for the convent who might be elderly or suffer from physical disabilities. The order quickly grew from its original foundation in Annecy, but it underwent a crisis in 1615 when the Archbishop of Lyons insisted that the order adopt a constitution, which would impose strict cloister on the nuns. De Chantal and De Sales protested since such restriction would destroy the announced apostolate of the order. However, in 1618, with Pope Urban VIII supporting the demand for cloister, the co-founders acquiesced. By the time of De Sales’s death in 1622, the order had thirteen houses. By the time of De Chantal’s death, it would count eighty-six.
From her headquarters in Annecy, De Chantal directed the order as its superior general. Besides frequent visitations to the order’s daughter houses, she maintained an extensive correspondence with her fellow nuns, benefactors, and laypeople seeking spiritual direction. Copied in manuscript form, her frequent lectures and conferences at Annecy were widely circulated among Visitation convents and other religious communities. During her lifetime she acquired a reputation for sanctity, although she often confided in her more intimate writings that she suffered from spiritual aridity and desolation during the decade preceding her death.
Her letters and addresses indicate the philosophical and theological culture she had developed, especially under the tutelage of De Sales. The works of De Sales constitute the most cited theological and philosophical sources. Among patristic authors, she often quotes St. Augustine and St. Jerome. She has a pronounced interest in the ascetical and mystical writers of the Spanish Counter-Reformation: Teresa of Ávila, Alphonsus Rodríguez, and Álvarez de Paz. Her virtue theory is clearly influenced by these authors. Other women authors cited by De Chantal include Catherine of Siena and Madame Acarie, the founder of the reformed French Carmelites.
Madame de Chantal died on December 13, 1641. The Catholic Church beatified her in 1751 and canonized her a saint in 1767.
The works of Jeanne de Chantal are exclusively religious in focus. Several hundred letters from her extensive correspondence have survived. She also wrote a long memorandum for the canonization process of François de Sales, Deposition for the Process of Beatification of St François de Sales and Responses Concerning Rules, Constitutions, and Customs, in which the superior general offered her interpretation of disputed points concerning the Visitation order’s charism and regulations. Many of the works of De Chantal were originally oral in nature. Visitation nuns transcribed her many addresses to nuns. These addresses included exhortations on spiritual topics such as the Rule of Saint Augustine, liturgical feasts, and occasional topics. More informal conferences, in which De Chantal answered questions posed by the nuns in assembly were also transcribed, as well as instructions given to novices at the very beginning of their convent life. The written transcriptions of these addresses should be treated with caution, since De Chantal’s actual words are often altered by the taste and perspective of the particular amanuensis. These addresses are of special philosophical interest because in these works De Chantal gives her most detailed theory of the virtues, of the nature of the soul, and of the divine attributes. The Visitation nuns circulated manuscript copies of these writings among the Visitation convents. Many of the original manuscripts remain in the archives at the Visitation motherhouse in Annecy.
During the lifetime of De Chantal, print versions of her works were already circulating. De Chantal objected to some of these publications since she wanted to confine most of her writings to circulation within the order. Shortly after her death, hagiographic biographies of the foundress circulated alongside the print versions of her writings. The 1751 beatification and 1767 canonization stimulated new interested in writings by and about De Chantal.
In the nineteenth century, the Visitation nuns at Annecy published the collected works of Madame de Chantal in Ste Jeanne Françoise Frémyot de Chantal, Sa vie et ses oeuvres (1874-1879.) The Visitation scholar Patricia Burns has recently published a critical edition of De Chantal’s letters in Jeanne-Françoise Frémyot de Chantal, Correspondance (1986-1996). The Visitation nuns have also been largely responsible for the English translation of the works of De Chantal. The Visitation convent of Harrow published Selected Letters of Saint Jane Frances de Chantal (1918). The Visitation convent of Bristol provided the translation for Saint Jane Frances Frémyot de Chantal, Exhortations, Conferences and Instructions (1929). The Visitation scholar Péronne Marie Thibert translated De Chantal’s letters for Francis de Sales and Jane de Chantal, Letters of Spiritual Direction (1988).
The philosophical arguments of De Chantal are embedded in a specific theological project: the guidance of nuns and laywomen toward perfection in Christ in the communion of the Catholic Church. The virtues defended by De Chantal are distinctively Christian with a strong monastic coloration. The analysis of the will emerges in the context of exhortations concerning the will’s perilous ascent toward union with God. Other faculties of the soul are studied through their relationship to the practice of prayer. The moral theory and philosophical psychology of De Chantal are situated in a context which has the convent as its primary audience and pedagogical concern.
In De Chantal’s works the standard moral virtues receive comparatively little attention. The discussions of temperance, fortitude, and justice are spare and indirect. De Chantal instead emphasizes virtues with a clear theological, indeed monastic, color: charity, humility, abnegation, and abandonment to the divine will. The moral habits prized by De Chantal reflect the distinctive culture of the convent, of the Visitation order with its stress on ascetical moderation, and of the Counter-Reformation with its mystical narrative of the soul in gradual ascent toward ecstatic union with God.
Humility constitutes the cornerstone of the edifice of virtue. More than simple meekness, humility entails a recognition of one’s utter dependence upon God for existence and salvation. “Humility of heart is nothing else than the genuine knowledge that we are nothing and that we can do nothing. It is desiring with a true desire that others should hold and treat us as such. What is called humility of heart makes us always annihilate ourselves in everything, without exception, and makes us consider ourselves always better treated and esteemed than we deserve” [Conference no. 40]. The emphasis on the annihilation of self as a psychological sign of true humility is typical of the era’s école française of spirituality, with its characteristic emphasis on annihilation (anéantissement) of personal desire as one of the signs of true union with God.
Humility enjoys a certain primacy among the virtues because it alone can perfect the internal life of the soul. Once humility has been acquired, the moral agent’s other internal dispositions and even external actions will find their proper place. “We do not apply ourselves to the true and solid interior virtues. We apply ourselves too much to the exterior. I do not mean to say that we should not practice and esteem the latter, but the interior ones are more precious to us. We owe our chief concern and fidelity to the acquisition of these, because they are more in conformity with our vocation and because the inward virtues bring about the exterior ones…..If our spirit were very humble and brought low, all our actions, all our words, and all our exterior would also be this way” [Exhortation no. 3.6]. Without the foundation of humility, the ensemble of a moral agent’s other virtues and the expression of these virtues through external acts would suffer an inevitable distortion.
While central to the moral life, the virtue of humility is acquired only with great difficulty. This difficulty springs from the disordered attachments that routinely enslave the moral subject. “There are three things we rid ourselves of only with difficulty. The first is honor, love, and self-esteem. The second is love of our bodies and their comforts. The third is the hatred we have for inward and outward submission … True humility tends to the contempt of this self-esteem and makes us love to be considered poor, ignorant, little, and imperfect, and to be forgotten by all creatures” [Conference no. 17] . The triumph of humility in the soul destroys attachments to corporeal goods, social acclaim, and willfulness, which prevent the soul from attaining authentic happiness.
The social expression of this humility in the life of the nun entails a certain egalitarianism. In dealing with either social superiors or peers, the humble nun exhibits a frank honesty that excludes flattery or condescension. “If we were sent to the parlor to speak with princes or princesses, we should not need to think about what we should say to them nor try to compose a speech. We should just tell them simply and without artifice what Our Lord might say to us, keeping ourselves humbly and faithful attentive to Him. Similarly, we should be very simple, cordial, and unpretentious in dealing with our sisters. We should respect and love them dearly, whether they be our superiors, equals, or inferiors. We should prefer them all to ourselves and prefer ourselves to no one” [Exhortation no. 4.17]. Based upon a refusal of one’s claim to social superiority, humility levels social distinctions among the laity and among the members of religious orders.
The model and source of this humility is Christological. It is Jesus himself who constitutes the perfect mirror of the humility the nun must cultivate. “How did that gentle Lord not abase Himself in honor? … He reduced Himself to such an extremity on that point that He suffered like any other mortal creature … From all powerful He appears all powerless; from all great, all little; from all terrible, all gentle and kind, allowing Himself to be guided like a tiny lamb; from all rich with the eternal riches of the Father of light, of Whom He is by nature the Eternal Son, He is become all poor among mortals, born in an obscure stable, and has only what He barely needs” [Exhortation no. 4.3]. The paradoxes of the Incarnation, especially the self-emptying of Christ as he takes flesh, illustrate humility in its purest possible form. Christ not only provides the model for humility, through grace, he infuses and strengthens the virtue within the pious moral subject.
Allied to humility is the virtue of simplicity. In the life of the nun, the vow of poverty permits her to give tangible external expression to the internal disposition of simplicity. Conventual simplicity involves both physical and spiritual renunciation. “Poverty of spirit is a detachment from all created things, if we possess them. This poverty of spirit requires us not to set our affections on them, so that we must be poor in affection and will concerning these things and have our heart detached and completely free … Another kind of poverty is to leave them for the love of God in order to serve Him more perfectly. We must leave them in affection and not only in fact. True and perfect poverty of spirit is to have nothing but God in our mind” [Conference no. 28]. The simplicity and poverty defended here have a contemplative end inasmuch as they free the moral subject to focus her attention on God alone.
In De Chantal’s writings, obedience ranks as one of the essential virtues, especially for the nun who has pronounced a vow of obedience to her superior. De Chantal’s high esteem for obedience is rooted in her hierarchical vision of the cosmos, of the political order, and of the church. “God, by His supreme wisdom, has arranged has arranged the order of the universe in the following way: He has made all creatures submissive and dependent on each other. The whole universal Church obeys the Sovereign Pontiff as the Vicar of our Lord Jesus Christ; each part of this Divine Spouse has a head, a bishop, whom it obeys. Moreover, all the religious orders have superior on which each subject depends. All private families have a father to direct and govern the family. I am not speaking here about political obedience and subjection. That would concern kings, princes, governors, and how soldiers obey their captains and how the entire body of an army obeys its general―they often show such an exact obedience that they shame us before God― I am only speaking to you now to make you understand that we are appointed to obey. We must do so in an exact following of the will of God, Who is the only end of the submission of our wills” [Conference no. 5.14]. In De Chantal’s perspective, the entire universe represents an elaborate hierarchy of command and submission ordained by God. The political and religious orders of human society imitate and participate in this hierarchy. The virtue of obedience involves the decision of the moral agent to respect these various hierarchies through the inclination of one’s personal will. In its purest form, that of the religious vow of obedience, obedience is the surrender of one’s will to the direction of one’s legitimate superior.
The virtue of obedience in religious life presupposes one’s obedience to the moral law, as interpreted by the church. The nub of the virtue of obedience in cloistered life is one’s complete indifference at the hands of one’s superior. This obedience reflects a personal spiritual freedom. “We should be ready to accomplish obedience, as many times as it shall be pleased to send us to any place and under any pretext, without any excuse. Some say they would prefer not to be sent to small towns under the apparently good pretext that they would have less spiritual help there or that they would be more exposed to danger in times of war or other similar excuses. If these people would examine themselves carefully and see themselves as they really are, they will find that their position is nothing but the fruit of pride, a pride so covered by these apparently good pretexts that they are blinded and do not even know the truth about themselves” [Exhortation no. 3.4]. The reasons given to refuse commands of religious obedience are only rationalizations born out of the moral subject’s desire for comfort and fear of suffering. Authentic obedience joins docility with indifference in the presence of a morally valid command from one’s superior.
Throughout her works, De Chantal stresses charity as the highest theological virtue. If humility is the foundation of the moral life, charity constitutes its summit. As with the other virtues, the monastic practice of charity possesses a note of detachment. “Thanks to God’s goodness, I have no particular like or dislike for any of my sisters. I love those who are good because God dwells them; I love those who are not so good because God wills that I should practice the holy virtue of charity. Those who do best give me the most consolation; those who do not do will afflict my heart. Still, my soul and my mind love all of them and I will spend and be spent in aiding, serving, and helping them” [Exhortation no. 4.13]. The affective indifference toward the different nuns as well as the fundamental virtue of charity is presented as the fruit of divine grace.
De Chantal not only privileges the theological virtues in her account of moral virtue, she often transforms ordinary moral virtues by redefining them in a monastic context. Her treatment of patience is typical. Patience emerges as a virtue central for the endurance of the seasons of spiritual aridity, which are inevitable in a serious life of contemplative prayer. “We must live in the present moment, without forecast and without worry about ourselves, concerning either the future or the present. We should do things just as they present themselves to us. We should profit by everything in good faith and without any other concern than that of pleasing God, by the means supplied by our vocation alone and without searching for some external resources” [Conference no. 35]. An ascetical virtue, patience permits the contemplative to focus on one’s present duties and not be distracted by memories of a past where God’s consolations were more palpable or in a desired future where God’s graces would be more tangible.
Not all moral virtues are capable of such a theological transformation. According to De Chantal, even some of the cardinal virtues oppose the proper moral formation of the Christian and nun. Prudence, for example, often allies itself with self-love and thus prevents the exercise of charity. “Self-love leads to the loss of everything in the spiritual life, because it brings forth its own seeking, which hinders us from seeking God and His good pleasure. Human prudence also does much harm; as long as we nourish this false prudence, this human spirit will act in us … It will be difficult to overcome these two enemies, for they are dexterous and deal their blows with such subtlety that very often we are not aware of them until they have done their part” [Exhortation no. 3.3]. Rather than crowning the philosophical ensemble of natural moral virtues, the constellation of theological virtues defended by De Chantal provides an alternative set of moral habits to be cultivated by the human subject in the quest of a happiness tied to salvation.
Another obstacle to the cultivation of authentic virtue is the empire of passions upon the human soul. De Chantal rejects the theory that some ascetical exercise or mystical experience could permanently extinguish the passions. Those who claim to live in such an emotion-free state are suffering from a serious spiritual illusion. When the passions break out in the soul, the virtuous Christian must learn how to carefully negotiate a gradual calming of the emotions. Violent efforts to oppose one’s passions will only result in failure. “Here is a little model of what we are to do when, rowing peacefully in our little boat, we feel, without thinking about it, all our passions arise and cause a great storm in us, as if they would overwhelm us and drag us after them. We must not wish to calm this tempest ourselves, but we must gently draw near the shore, keeping our will firmly in God, and coast along the small waves, to reach, through humble self-knowledge, God, who is our sure port. Let us go along gently, without effort and without yielding to our passions anything they wish. By so doing, we will arrive later in that divine port with more glory than if we had enjoyed a perfect calm and had steered our boat without any difficulty” [Conference no. 6]. The passions constitute an essential part of human nature; any effort to deny their power rests on an illusion concerning the affective dimension of the human subject. Providentially, God’s tolerance of the many unexpected eruptions of passion permits the virtuous Christian to recognize one’s finitude and to acknowledge the limits of the power of one’s will.
De Chantal’s philosophy of human nature focuses primarily upon the faculty of the will. Distorted by original sin and concupiscence, human nature must undergo a reformation if it is to achieve its proper fulfillment in union with God. It is in abandonment to divine providence that the human will, often disfigured by self-love, finds its proper happiness.
Conventual life is a paradigm of how sinful nature must be transformed into a nature redeemed by grace. This overcoming of self-loving human nature constitutes the purpose of the vowed life in community. “We have not come within these walls to live according to nature; we are taught from the commencement that we must overcome it. We must then do this with generosity and, instead of following self-love and the human spirit, live by a holy strength of the mind, according to the lights of grace and reason. These two lights, properly followed, are enough for leading the soul to the highest perfection of divine love” [Exhortation no. 3.3]. Properly sanctified, human nature emerges at the end of a spiritual itinerary of conversion, not at its origin. The insistence on the complementarity of reason and grace reflects the characteristic moderation of De Chantal’s theological positions.
The requisite conversion of nature requires a certain violence to oneself. Vices can be eradicated and virtues cultivated only at the price of this internal spiritual combat. “I tell you often that heaven suffers violence and that the conquerors and the strong carry it way. He who will go on to perfection must renounce himself and carry his cross. All these are words uttered by the Eternal Truth … We have love of God to the degree we mortify ourselves and earnestly subject our nature … We shall never truly please God except by destroying our nature. We shall never enjoy interior peace unless we practice mortification and the entire renunciation of our interior inclinations” [Exhortation no. 4.14]. This ascetical anthropology conceives human nature as a nature to be morally purified and strengthened both by grace and by ascetical measures. Rather than being a metaphysical given, human nature is to be resisted, transformed, and molded in an itinerary of strenuous personal reformation.
One of the prerequisites for this ascetical transformation is authentic self-knowledge. Allied to the virtue of humility, accurate self-knowledge acknowledges one’s moral misery in the state of sin. “We must really know ourselves, our nothingness, our meanness, and our vileness. If our understanding is filled with this truth, we shall see clearly that there are many defects, imperfections, and many things to reform in us. In truth, we are full of wretchedness and poverty” [Conference no. 1]. The self-knowledge prized here is the frank recognition of one’s morally depraved state.
The acquisition of such self-knowledge is difficult. All too often human efforts at introspection are biased by self-love; it is only through divine grace that the human subject can make a realistic appraisal of his or her morally perilous state. “There is a vast difference between looking at ourselves in God’s sight and looking at ourselves in our own. If we look at ourselves in God’s sight, we shall see ourselves as we really are, but if we look at ourselves in our own sight, we shall see ourselves as self-love suggests. This love of ourselves does us great harm. Unless we mortify it and overthrow its favorite pursuits and interests, its vanity and good opinion of oneself, we shall not advance on our way and we shall always remain dwarfs in virtue” [Exhortation no. 4.2].
At the center of this spiritual struggle lies the human faculty of the will. The will’s intentions largely determine whether a particular soul will overcome its sinfulness and truly adhere to God through a process of purification. In a virtuous soul, the desire to do God’s will should be the only motive in one’s conduct, regardless of emotional or economic circumstances. “Solid virtue consists in attaching ourselves only to God, in wishing for God alone, in seeking God alone, and in depending on God alone, in serving him constantly and with perseverance in whatever state He places us, whether we be in prosperity or adversity, in consolation or affliction, in health or in sickness, in dryness or in sweetness. The failing to take pleasure in the good actions we do takes away neither the power of doing them nor the merit of them. On the contrary, they are more agreeable to God when there is less of us in them, because we are acting more purely for Him” [Conference no. 26]. It is in the subservience of the human will to the divine will that authentic union of the soul with God emerges.
The summit of this voluntaristic union with God lies in the act of spiritual abandonment. The human agent abandons his or her will into the divine will. The moral life becomes the effort to permit the divine will to direct one’s actions as purely as possible. “It is a true point that we find the highest and most sublime perfection when we are entirely given over to, dependent upon, and submissive to the events of Divine Providence. If we have indeed surrendered to this providence … it would be indifferent to us to be humbled or exalted, to be led by this hand or the other, to be in dryness, aridity, sorrow, and privation, or to be comforted by the divine unction and by the sensible enjoyment of God. In fact, we should keep ourselves in the good hands of the great God like cloth in the hands of the tailor, who cuts it in a hundred ways for use as he pleases” [Conference no. 41]. The passage reflects the Salesian emphasis on abandonment to divine providence as the keystone of spiritual maturity and of psychological peace. The climax of human will is in its durable immersion in the divine will. This voluntaristic anthropology places the itinerary of the will at the center of the moral and spiritual journey of the human subject.
Practical in orientation, the writings of De Chantal rarely engage in speculative theology. Several works, however, focus on the attributes of God. De Chantal attempts to link the contemplation of the divine attributes to motivation for confidence in God in this life and to hope of possessing God in the next.
In seeking solid reasons for hoping in God’s providence, De Chantal underlines three divine attributes: omnipotence, perfect goodness, and perfect wisdom. “You wish to know the foundations upon which we are to support our confidence in God. Here you have three points: first, because He is all wise; second, because He is all good; third, because He is all powerful. Consequently, He knows everything we need for our soul and body. He is all good and goodness itself; He shows this by what He has done for us. He is all powerful because He gives us what He sees to be necessary for us” [Instruction no. 1]. Confidence in divine providence is not based on a generic act of faith in God; it arises from a consideration of specific attributes in God, which render Him worthy of this act of trust in difficult circumstances. Divine power, wisdom, and goodness permit the believer to understand why God, and only God, merits such a total act of faith and hope.
The divine attributes hold a particular prominence in De Chantal’s account of the faithful soul’s destiny after death. In the beatific vision of God, the soul will contemplate the divine attributes it has only obscurely glimpsed during the laborious meditations of terrestrial life. Divine goodness, immensity, and majesty are the particular objects of this celestial vision. “When we shall be in possession of the glory of paradise, how great will be our astonishment on seeing the infinite goodness, the incomprehensible immensity, and the supreme majesty of God, who has lowered Himself so far as to desire the love of the creature, which is so vile and cruel! If the soul were capable of dying, it would die at the sight of this excessive love, this immense greatness of its Creator, which has so favored it. It would see how badly it has corresponded to this love and the wrong it did itself in being taken up with the things of life, with trifles which had the power to separate it from its God and make it lose the incomparable good of this immortal happiness and of the vision of the divine essence” [Conference no. 20]. The passage has echoes of the Augustinian theory of the ideas in the mind of God. The infinite goodness, limitlessness, and majesty, which were perceived in an indirect and fleeting way during moments of terrestrial reflection, are now immediately grasped in the soul’s undying contemplation of the divine essence. This beatific vision does not only contemplate God in all of the divine simplicity, it contemplates the eternal ideas that constitute God’s attributes.
Augustinian influence suffuses the works of De Chantal. After François de Sales, Saint Augustine is the most cited author in her writings. Her theory of concupiscence and of divine ideas bears Augustinian traces. Her Augustinianism emerges most clearly in her commentary on the Rule of Saint Augustine, delivered as a series of exhortations to the Visitation nuns.
The Rule of Saint Augustine is actually a compilation of documents written by Augustine of Hippo himself and by later Augustinian writers. Saint Augustine authored Letter 211 to a community of nuns seeking to reform themselves and Sermons 355 and 356 on the life and death of clerics. Aelred of Rievaulx composed Of the Eremitical Life in the twelfth century. The authorship of Monastic Consortia, Rule for Clerics, and Second Rule remains uncertain. The Rule of Saint Augustine describes the virtues of religious life but provides few detailed prescriptive laws. When confronted by the proliferation of religious orders, the Catholic Church insisted that new orders must use one of the preexisting rules as the basis for their constitutions; many chose The Rule of Saint Augustine on account of its brevity and its flexibility. The Visitation order chose the rule and adapted it to its own purposes. De Chantal’s commentaries on the text transpose the rule in a gendered key by adapting it to the requirements of an exclusively female community. Her exhortations echo the Neo-Platonism of Augustine himself by her repeated efforts to interpret physical realities in light of the spiritual realities or ideas to which they point.
Following Augustine, De Chantal designates love as the principal end and rule of religious community. “In this Rule St. Augustine proposes to us, in the first place, the great commandment of God, and tells us that ‘God is to be loved before all things and after Him our neighbor.’ This commandment then must needs be the foundation and the basis of our perfection, for in the observance of this lies the sum of Christian and religious perfection” [Exhortation no. 1.1]. All the moral precepts of the Christian life are subsumed under the single commandment to love God and to love one’s neighbor.
Practical in orientation, De Chantal uses Augustine’s counsels on love as a criterion for an examination of conscience by the nuns. The moral weaknesses of the community reflect the lack of fidelity to the demanding love proposed by the gospel and the Augustinian rule. “Do we never do to our neighbor anything but what we wish should be done to ourselves? Are we as pleased with her welfare as we are with our own? Do we truly hide her faults? Are we indeed pliant toward all her wishes? Have we a sense of her sorrows? Are we very careful to console, serve, and comfort him? No! We commonly wish to be preferred to her; nevertheless, you see what this commandment obliges us to do” (Exhortation no. 1.1). The Augustinian ideal of disinterested love becomes the measure by which the actions of community members are to be judged and corrected.
Addressing a convent audience, De Chantal specifies how the Augustinian norm of love is to be pursued by the nuns. Her distinction between spiritual and natural love is gendered inasmuch as it cites personality traits traditionally associated with women rather than men. “In a few words, St. Augustine tells us excellently how we must love our Sisters: ‘Now, there ought not to be any sensual love among us, but only spiritual love.’ This is the point: Do not love each other with natural, sensual fondness, founded on frivolous qualities, such as relationship, alliance, familiarity, correspondence, resemblance, mental sympathy, temperamental similarity, and a thousand other foolish things imagined by the human mind. In the same way, our minds should banish such follies as natural beauty and the charms of good breeding. We are to love our Sisters, not with a human love, not with a self-interested love, but as our holy Rule says, with ‘spiritual affection,’ with a certain interior and cordial attachment to virtue and not to other things” [Exhortation no. 1.14]. In this pursuit of spiritual love, the nuns should pay particular attention to their conduct during conversation. Gossip and backbiting can prove particularly destructive in the conventual pursuit of a properly purified love.
At the antipodes of this spiritual love is the self-love that fosters a spiritual dishonesty. Focusing on the specific challenges of conventual life, De Chantal describes how coyness in dealing with illness can subtly manifest this self-love. “I want to … speak of a certain whimsicalness of self-love which creeps into some community members. When they have something amiss, they will not tell it to their superior; someone else must tell it. This behavior can proceed from no other cause but pride. There is a wish to appear very generous and not to tell one’s ailment, but it must be made known. To stand now on one foot, now on the other, to rub one’s forehead, to appear out of breath … I declare that when I see such trickiness, I will simply avoid you. I will let you suffer with your self-love and act as though I did not see you” [Exhortation no. 1.11]. Self-love is often expressed as emotional immaturity and veiled attention-seeking. A spiritual love can emerge in the convent only if the superior firmly refuses to acknowledge demands for loving attention rooted in self-pity.
In numerous passages De Chantal follows the Neo-Platonic logic of Augustine by interpreting physical objects as the sign or embodiment of spiritual realities. Her treatment of poverty is typical. Augustine’s modest, concrete counsel to “keep all your clothes in one place, under the keeping of one or two Sisters” becomes the occasion for De Chantal to expand on a completely spiritualized concept of poverty. Rather than a being a virtue confined to the treatment of material objects, poverty emerges as a virtue of strict spiritual detachment. “In what do you think the purest poverty and finest observation of this virtue consists? It consists, not only in having nothing of our own and in not being attached to what is given for our use, but it makes us rejoice in the lack of necessary things and that the least thing in the house is given to us … It stretches into the very recesses of the heart, unclothing the soul of the things that are most savory and spiritual, leading it to practice an excellent poverty of spirit, depriving it of the ardent superfluous desires of perfection, hiding from it its advances, and making it suffer with submission nakedness and withdrawal of interior goods” [Exhortation no. 1.7]. This spiritual poverty lies in a will completely abandoned to God’s good pleasure and no longer solicitous of either physical or spiritual consolations.
The Neo-Platonic strain of Augustinianism also emerges in De Chantal’s concept of God and the soul. Both God and the soul are described under the rubric of the transcendental of beauty. “We are enamored of spiritual beauty. Now, you know that the nature of the will is such that as soon as it has discovered some fair and lovable object, it at once desires to possess and enjoy it. All beauty, all goodness, all perfection, come down from God, who is supremely beautiful, good, and perfect. This goodness which is in Him leads Him to communicate to the souls who serve Him some particles of these virtues … We shall arrive at the enjoyment of that spiritual beauty, more to be desired than all the delights of the palace” [Exhortation no. 1.18]. Framed in aesthetic terms, the soul’s pursuit of God emerges as the quest for infinite beauty, which gradually embellishes the soul with virtues as the questing soul becomes more like the image of perfect beauty, God.
The reception of the philosophy of De Chantal falls roughly into two periods. Until the twentieth century, interest in De Chantal’s writings was largely devotional. The Visitation order was the primary public for her writings. The Annecy convent’s edition of the complete works of De Chantal (1874-1879) indicates the veneration accorded by the Visitation nuns toward the writings of their foundress. By a quirk of ecclesiastical history, the Visitation order, reduced to strict cloister in the seventeenth century, began to conduct schools in the nineteenth century. The students and alumnae of the Visitation academies become avid readers of the works of De Chantal and practitioners of her spirituality.
In the twentieth century a more scholarly approach toward the writings of De Chantal emerged. Brémond (1912) presented De Chantal as a spiritual theologian with a complex variation on the Salesian theme of abandonment to divine providence. Georges-Thomas (1963) and Ravier (1983) further pursued the exploration of De Chantal’s ascetical and mystical theology. Gazier (1915) studied the relationship of De Chantal to Jansenism; Mézard (1928) analyzed her doctrine of the soul; Giraud (1929) considered the relationship of her writing style to her spirituality. Recent studies have explored certain philosophical themes in De Chantal. Wright (1988) and Bowden (1995) examine the gendered nature of her moral arguments; Bouchard (2004) and Kroug (2010) evaluate her philosophy of love; Wright (1985) considers her concept of perfection. De Chantal’s philosophy of virtue and her relationship to the Augustinian revival of the seventeenth century invite further research.
John J. Conley
Loyola University Maryland
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 31, 2012 | Originally published: