Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Cheng Hao (Cheng Mingdao, 1032—1085)

Cheng_HaoCheng Hao, also known as Cheng Mingdao, was a pioneer of the neo-Confucian movement in the Song and Ming dynasties, which is often regarded as the second epoch of the development of Confucianism, with pre-Qin classical Confucianism as the first, and contemporary Confucianism as the third. If neo-Confucianism is to be understood as the learning of li (conventionally translated as “principle”), then Cheng Hao and his younger brother Cheng Yi can be regarded as the true founders of neo-Confucianism, as with them li came to be regarded as the ultimate reality of the universe for the first time in Chinese history . Cheng Hao’s unique understanding of the ultimate reality is that it is not some entity but rather is the “life-giving activity.” This understanding strikes a similar tone to Martin Heidegger’s Being of beings which was created almost a millennium later. Assuming the identity of li and human nature, Cheng Hao argues that human nature is good, since what is essential to human nature is humanity (ren), also the cardinal virtue in Confucianism, and this is nothing but this life-giving activity. A person of ren is the one who is in one body with “ten thousand things” and therefore can feel their pains and itches just as one can feel them in one’s own body. This is an idea central to the whole idealist school (xinxue, learning of heart-mind) of the neo-Confucian movement, a movement culminating in Wang Yangming.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Principle
  3. Goodness of Human Nature
  4. Origin of Evil
  5. Moral Cultivation
  6. Influence
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Works

Cheng Hao was born in Huangpi of the present Hubei Province in Mingdao Year 1 of Emperor Ren of the Song dynasty (1032) and so is also called Mr. Mingdao. He and his younger brother Cheng Yi (1033-1107) are often referred to as “the two Chengs” by later Confucians. Growing up, the brothers moved quite often as their father, Cheng Xiang, was appointed as a local official in various places. In 1046, his father became acquainted with Zhou Dunyi (1016-1073), one of the so-called “five Confucian masters” of the Northern Song. He sent Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi – who themselves turned out to be the other two of the five masters – to study with Zhou for about a year. In 1057, after passing the civil service examination, Cheng Hao followed in his father’s footsteps and started his own career as a local official, culminating in his initial participation in (1069) and eventual withdrawal from (1070) the reform movement led by Wang Anshi (1021-1086). Cheng Hao returned to Luoyang after 1072 and continued to assume a few minor official positions, but he spent most of his time studying and teaching Confucian classics together with his brother. During this period, the brothers also had frequent discussions with the final two of the five masters, Shao Yong (1011-1077) and Zhang Zai (1020-1077). The former was their neighbor in Luoyang, and the latter was their uncle.

Cheng Hao’s philosophical ideas are largely developed in conversations with his students, many of whom recorded his sayings. In 1168, Zhu Xi (1130-1200) edited some of these recorded sayings in Chengs’ Surviving Sayings (Yishu) in 25 volumes, in which 4 volumes are attributed to Cheng Hao and 11 volumes to Cheng Yi. The first 10 volumes are sayings by the two masters, where in most cases it is not clearly indicated which saying belongs to which brother. In 1173, Zhu Xi edited Chengs’ Additional Sayings (Waishu) in 12 volumes, including those recorded sayings circulated among scholars and not included in Yishu (in most cases, it is not indicated which saying belongs to which Cheng). As Zhu Xi himself acknowledged that the authenticity of sayings in this second collection is mixed, it should be used with caution. Before Zhu Xi edited these two works, Yang Shi (1053-1135), one of the common students of the two Chengs, rewrote some of these sayings in a literary form in The Purified Words of the Two Chengs (Cuiyan). However, it mostly represents Cheng Yi’s views. Cheng Hao’s own writings, mostly official documents, letters, and poetry, are collected in the first four volumes of Chengs’ Collected Writings (Wenji). In addition, Cheng Hao wrote a correction of the Great Learning, which is included in Chengs’ Commentary on Classics (Jingshuo). All of these are now conveniently collected in the two volume edition of Works of the Two Chengs (Er Cheng Ji) by Zhonghua Shuju, Beijing (1981).

2. Principle

What is called neo-Confucianism in Western scholarship is most frequently called lixue, or the learning of li (commonly translated as “principle”), in Chinese scholarship. Lixue refers to neo-Confucianism in the Song and Ming (and sometimes Qing) dynasties. However, although “neo-Confucianism” was originally used to translate lixue, it is now sometimes understood more broadly than lixue to include Confucianism in the Tang Dynasty which preceded it. Cheng Hao and his younger brother Cheng Yi can be properly regarded as the founders of neo-Confucianism as the learning of principle. Although Shao Yong, Zhou Dunyi, and Zhang Zai are often also treated as neo-Confucians in this sense, it is in Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi that li first becomes the central concept in a philosophical system. Cheng Hao makes a famous claim that “although I have learned much from others, the two words tian li are what I grasped myself” (Waishu 12; 425). Tian is commonly translated as “heaven,” although it can also mean “sky” or “nature.” By combining these two words, however, Cheng Hao does not mean to emphasize that it is a principle of heaven or a heavenly principle but simply that heaven, the term traditionally used to refer to the ultimate reality, is nothing but principle (see Yishu 11; 132), and so tian li simply means “heaven-principle.” As a matter of fact, not only tian, but many other terms such as “change” (yi), dao, shen (literally “god,” but Cheng Hao focuses on its meaning of “being wonderful and unfathomable” ), “human nature” (xing), and “lord” (di) are all seen as identical to principle. For example, Cheng Hao claims that “what the heaven embodies does not have sound or smell. In terms of the reality, it is change; in terms of principle, it is dao; in terms of its function, it is god; in terms of its destiny in a human being, it is human nature” (Yishu 1; 4). “Tian is nothing but principle. We call it god to emphasize the wonderful mystery of principle in ten thousand things, just as we call it lord (di) to characterize its being the ruler of events ” (Yishu 11; 132). He even identifies it with heart-mind (xin) (Yishu 5; 76) and propriety (li). Because Cheng Hao thinks that all these terms have the same referent as principle, his philosophy is often regarded an ontological monism.

From this it becomes clear in what sense Cheng Hao claims that he grasps the meaning of tian li on his own. After all he must be aware that not only the two words separately, tian and li, but even the two words combined into one phrase, tian li, had appeared in Confucian texts before him. So what he means is that principle is understood here as the ultimate reality of the universe that has been referred to as heaven, god, lord, dao, nature, heart-mind, and change among others. In other words, with Cheng Hao “principle” acquires an ontological meaning for the first time in the Confucian tradition. Thus Cheng Hao claims that “there is only one principle under heaven, and so it is efficacious throughout the world. It has not changed since the time of three kings and remains the same between heaven and earth” (Yishu 2a; 39). In contrast, everything in the world exists because of principle. Thus Cheng Hao claims that “ten thousand things all have principle, and it is easy to follow it but difficult to go against it” (Yishu 11; 123). In other words, things prosper when principle is followed and disintegrate when it is violated. One of the most unique ideas of Cheng Hao is that ten thousand things form one body, and he tells us that “the reason that ten thousand things can be in one body is that they all have principle” (Yishu 2a; 33).

While principle is the ontological foundation of ten thousand things, Cheng Hao emphasizes that, unlike Plato’s form, it is not temporally prior to or spatially outside of ten thousand things. This can be seen from his discussion of two related pairs of ideas. The first pair is dao and concrete things (qi). After quoting from the Book of Change that “what is metaphysical (xing er shang) is called dao, while what is physical (xing er xia) is called concrete thing” (Yishu 11; 119), Cheng Hao immediately adds that “outside dao there are no things and outside things there is no dao” (Yishu 4; 73). In other words, what is metaphysical is not independent of the physical; the former is right within the latter. The second pair is principle (dao, human nature, god) and vital force (qi). In Cheng Hao’s view, “everything that is tangible is vital force, and only dao is intangible” (Yishu 6; 83). However, he emphasizes that “human nature is inseparable from vital force, and vital force is inseparable from human nature” (Yishu 1; 10), and that “there is no god (shen) outside vital force, and there is no vital force outside god” (Yishu 1; 10).

What does Cheng Hao precisely mean by principle, which is intangible and does not have sound or smell? Although translated here as “principle” according to convention, li for Cheng Hao is not a reified entity as the common essence shared by all things or universal law governing these things or inherent principle followed by these things or patterns exhibited by these things. Li as used by Cheng is a verb referring to activity, not a noun referring to thing. For example, he says that “the cold in the winter and the hot in the summer are [vital forces] yin and yang; yet the movement and change [of vital forces] is god” (Yihsu 11; 121). Since god for Cheng means the same as li, li is here understood as the movement and change of vital forces and things constituted by vital forces. Since things and li are inseparable, as li is understood as movement and change, all things are things that move and change, while movement and change are always movement and change of things. Things are tangible, have smell, and make sound, but their movement and change is intangible and does not have sound or smell. We can never perceive things’ activities, although we can perceive things that act. For example we can perceive a moving car, but we cannot perceive the car’s moving. In Cheng Hao’s view, principle as activity is present not only in natural things but also in human affairs. Thus, illustrating what he means by “nowhere between heaven and earth there is no dao” (Yishu 4; 73), Cheng points out that “in the relation of father and son, to be father and son lies in affection; in the relation of king and minister, to be king and minister lies in seriousness (reverence). From these to being husband and wife, being elder and younger brothers, being friends, there is no activity that is no dao. That is why we cannot be separated from dao even for a second” (Yishu 4; 73-74). Cheng makes it clear that the principle that governs these human relations is such activity as affection and reverence.

However, in what sense can li as activity be regarded as the ontological foundation of things, as activity is not self-existent and has to belong to something? For Cheng Hao, li is a special kind of activity. To explain this, Cheng Hao appeals to the idea of the unceasing life-giving activity (sheng sheng) from the Book of Change. Commenting on the statement that “The unceasing life-giving activity is called change” in the Book of Change, Cheng Hao argues that “it is right in this life-giving activity that li is complete” (Yishu 2a; 33). So li is the kind of activity that gives life. It is indeed in this sense of life-giving activity that Cheng Hao regards dao and tian as identical to li, as he claims that “because of this [the unceasing life-giving activity] tian can be dao. Tian is dao only because it is the life-giving activity” (Yishu 2a; 29). Thus, although life-giving activity is always the life-giving activity of ten thousand things, ten thousand things cannot come into being without the life-giving activity. It is in this sense that the life-giving activity of ten thousand things becomes ontologically prior to ten thousand things that have the life-giving activity. This is quite similar to Martin Heidegger’s ontology of Being: while Being is always the Being of beings, beings are being because of their Being.

3. Goodness of Human Nature

Since for Cheng Hao, human nature (xing) is nothing but principle destined in human beings, and since principle is nothing but life-giving activity (sheng), this life-giving activity is also human nature. It is in this sense that he speaks approvingly of Gaozi’s sheng zhi wei xing, a view criticized in the Mencius. By sheng zhi wei xing, Gaozi means that “what one is born with is nature.” Mencius criticizes this view and argues that human nature is what distinguishes human beings from non-human beings, which according to him is the beginning of four cardinal Confucian virtues: humanity (ren), rightness (yi), propriety (li), and wisdom (zhi). When Cheng Hao claims that what Gaozi says is indeed correct, however, he does not mean to disagree with Mencius. On the contrary, he endorses Mencius’ view in the same passage where he approves Gaozi’s view. This is because Cheng Hao has a very different understanding of sheng in sheng zhi wei xing than Gaozi does. For Gaozi, sheng means what one is born with, while for Cheng Hao it is the life-giving activity, which is the ultimate reality of the universe. So for Gaozi the phrase says that what humans are born with is human nature, but for Cheng Hao it means that the life-giving activity is human nature. This is most clear because Cheng Hao quotes this saying of Gaozi together with the statement from the Book of Change that “the greatest virtue of heaven and earth is the life-giving activity” and then explains this statement in his own words: “the most spectacular aspect of things is their atmosphere of life-giving activity” (Yishu 11; 120).

To understand human nature as the life-giving activity, it is important to see the actual content of human nature for Cheng Hao: “These five, humanity, rightness, propriety, wisdom, and faithfulness, are human nature. Humanity is like the complete body and the other four are like the four limbs” (Yishu 2a; 14). So his view of human nature is basically the same as Mencius, except he adds the fifth component, faithfulness. Since these five components of human nature are also five cardinal Confucian virtues, Cheng Hao talks about “virtuous human nature” (dexing) and “virtue of human nature” (xing zhi de): “ ‘virtuous nature’ indicates the worthiness of nature and so means the same thing as goodness of human nature. ‘Virtues of human nature’ refers to what human nature possesses” (Yishu 11; 125). To illustrate the goodness of human nature, Cheng Hao highlights the importance of humanity (ren), regarding it as the complete human nature that includes the other four components, because “rightness, propriety, wisdom, and faithfulness are all humanity” (2a; 16-17). For Cheng, humanity is precisely the life-giving activity. In the same passage in which he affirms Gaozi’s saying, after stating that “the atmosphere of life-giving activity is most spectacular,” Cheng Hao further makes it clear that it is humanity that continues the life-giving activity: “ ‘what is great and originating becomes (in humans) the first and chief (quality of goodness).’ This quality is known as humanity” (Yishu 11; 120). Thus, for Cheng Hao, humanity is not merely a human virtue. It is actually no different from the life-giving activity. Just like heaven, dao, god, and lord, it is indistinguishable from principle (li) as the ultimate reality.

Understood as life-giving activity, it becomes clear why human nature, which can be illustrated by humanity (as it includes other components of human nature) is good. In Cheng Hao’s view, this sense of life-giving activity that humanity (ren) has is best explained by doctors when they refer to a person who is numb as lacking ren: “doctors regard a person as not-ren when the person cannot feel pain and itch; we regard a person as lacking humanity when the person does not know, is not conscious of, and cannot recognize rightness and principle. This is the best analogy” (Yishu 2a; 33). A person whose hands and feet are numb cannot even feel the pain of oneself, to say nothing of that of others. In contrast, “a person of humanity will be in one body with ten thousand things” (2a; 15). This means that a person of humanity, a person who is not numb (lacking ren) is sensitive to the pain of other beings, not only human beings but also non-human beings, in the same way that one is sensitive to one’s own pain.

A difficulty in understanding Cheng Hao’s view of human nature is that he sometimes seems to think that not only good but also evil can be attributed to human nature and principle. About the former, he states that, “while goodness indeed belongs to human nature, it cannot be said that evil does not belong to human nature” (Yishu 1; 10). About the latter, he says that “it is tian li that there are both good and evil in the world” (Yishu 2a; 14) and “that some things are good and some things are evil” (2b; 17). In both cases, however, Cheng Hao does not mean that evil belongs to human nature or principle in the same way as good belongs to human nature, and so what he says in these passages is not inconsistent with his view of human nature as good. As for evil belonging to human nature, Cheng Hao uses the analogy of water. Just as we cannot say muddy water is not water, so we cannot say the distorted human nature is not human nature. Here Cheng Hao makes it clear that water is originally clear, and human nature is originally good. That is why in the same passage in which he says that evil cannot be said not to belong to human nature, he emphasizes that Mencius is right in insisting that human nature is good. So goodness inherently belongs to human nature, while evil is only externally attached to and therefore can be detached from human nature, just as clearness inherently belongs to water, while mud is only externally mixed in and therefore can be eliminated from water (Yishu 1; 10-11). In the two passages in which Cheng Hao states that it is li or tian li that there are both good and evil people, Cheng does not mean that heaven or principle as life-giving activity is both good and evil. In such contexts, Cheng Hao means something different by li and tian li. It does not mean heaven or principle but means something similar to what Descartes sometimes called “natural light.” What he says in these passages is then that it is natural or naturally understandable (tian li) that there are good people and there are bad people. The question then is why it is natural or naturally understandable to have both good people and evil people when human nature is purely good.

4. Origin of Evil

Cheng Hao holds the view that human nature is good and yet thinks it natural that there are both good people and evil people. To explain this, like many other neo-Confucians, Cheng Hao appeals to the distinction between principle and vital force (qi). While the ideas of both principle (li) (to which human nature is identical) and vital force (qi), appeared in earlier Confucian texts, it is in neo-Confucianism that these two become an important pair. In Cheng Hao’s view, “it is not complete to talk about human nature without talking about qi, while it is not illuminating to talk about qi without talking about human nature” (Yishu 6; 81). It is common among neo-Confucians to regard human nature as good and to attribute the origin of evil to the vital force. In this respect Cheng Hao is not an exception. Cheng Hao claims that it is natural that there are good people and evil people precisely because of vital force. Thus, in the same passage in which he uses the analogy of water, after claiming that human nature and vital force cannot be separated from each other, he states that “human life is endowed with vital force, and therefore it is naturally understandable (li) that there are good and evil (people)…. Some people have been good since childhood, and some people have been evil since childhood. This is all because of the vital force they are endowed with” (Yishu 1; 10). Then he uses the analogy of water. Water is the same everywhere, but some water becomes muddy after flowing a short distance, some becomes muddy after flowing a long distance, and some remains clear even when flowing into the sea. The original state of water is clear; whether it remains clear or becomes muddy depends upon the condition of the route it flows. The original state of human nature is good; whether a person remains good or becomes evil depends upon the quality of the vital force the person is endowed with.

There is an apparent problem, however, with this solution to the problem of the origin of evil. Cheng Hao argues that what constitutes human nature is not only present in human beings but also in all ten thousand things. Thus, after explaining the five constant components of human nature – humanity, rightness, propriety, wisdom, and faithfulness – Cheng Hao points out that “all ten thousand things have the same nature, and these five are constant natures” (Yishu 9; 105). Cheng Hao repeatedly claims that ten thousand things form one body. In his view, this is “because all ten thousand things have the same principle”; human beings are born with a complete nature, but “we cannot say other things do not have it” (Yishu 2a; 33). Thus Cheng Hao argues that horses and cows also love their children, because the four beginnings that Mencius talks about are also present in them (Yishu 2b; 54). In other words, in terms of nature, there is no difference between human beings and other beings. The difference between human beings and other beings lies in their ability to extend (tui) the principle destined in ten thousand things (to extend the natural love beyond one’s intimate circle), and the difference in this ability further lies in the kind of vital force they are respectively endowed with. Thus Cheng Hao argues that “Humans can extend the principle, while things cannot because their vital force is muddy” (Yishu 2a; 33). Here, he emphasizes that the vital force that animals are endowed with is not clear. In contrast, “the vital force that human beings are endowed with is most clear, and therefore human beings can become partner [with heaven and earth]” (Yishu 2b; 54). In addition to this distinction between clear and muddy vital forces, Cheng Hao also claims that the vital force that humans are endowed with is balanced (zheng), while the vital force that animals are endowed with is one-sided (pian). After reaffirming that human heart-mind is the same as the heart-mind of animals and plants, he says that “the difference between human beings and other beings is whether the vital force they are respectively endowed with is balanced or one-sided [between yin and yang]. Neither yin alone nor yang alone can give birth to anything. When one-sided, yin and yang give birth to birds, beast, and barbarians; when balanced, yin and yang give birth to humans” (Yishu 1; 4; see also Yishu 11; 122).

Cheng Hao thus makes precisely the same distinction between good people and evil people as he makes between human beings and animals. The apparent problem here would seem to be that evil people would then be indistinguishable from animals since they are both endowed with turbid, one-sided, and mixed vital force, as Cheng Hao does often regard evil people as beasts. However, the problem is rather: since Cheng Hao believes that animals cannot be transformed into human beings because their endowed vital force is turbid, one-sided, and mixed, how can he believe, as he does, that evil humans who are also endowed with such turbid, one-sided, and mixed vital force can be transformed into moral beings and even sages? In other words, what is the difference between evil humans and beasts that makes the difference?

Cheng Hao seems to be aware of this problem, and he attempts to solve it by making the distinction between host vital force (zhu qi) and alien or guest vital force (ke qi). For example, he states that “rightness (yi) and the principle (li) on the one side and the alien vital force on the other often fight against each other. The distinction between superior persons and inferior persons is made according to the degree of the one conquered by another. The more the principle and rightness gain the upper hand…the more the alien vital force is extinguished” (Yishu 1; 4-5). For human beings, the host vital force is the one that is constitutive of human beings, which makes human being a bodily existence, while the guest vital force is constitutive of the environment, in which a human being, as a bodily existence, is born and lives. This distinction between host and alien vital force is equivalent to the one between internal (nei qi) and external vital force (wai qi) that his brother Cheng Yi makes, and therefore the analogy the Cheng Yi uses to explain the latter distinction can assist us in understanding the former distinction. For Cheng Yi, the internal vital force is not mixed with but absorbs nourishment from the external vital force. Then he uses the analogy of fish in water to explain it: “The life of fish is not caused by water. However, only by absorbing nourishment from water can fish live. Human beings live between heaven and earth in the same way as fish live in water. The nourishment humans receive from drinking and food is from the external vital force” (Yishu 15; 165-166).

In this analogy, a fish has both its internal or host vital force, the vital force that it is internally endowed with, which accounts for its corporeal form, and its external or guest vital force, the vital force it is externally endowed with, which provides the environment in which fish can live. This analogy performs the same function as Cheng Hao’s own analogy of water (mentioned above). Water itself is a bodily being with a nature and internal vital force, both of which guarantee its clearness. However, water has to exist in external vital force (river, for example). If this external vital force is also favorable, the water will remain clear, but if it is not favorable, the water will become muddy. In this analogy, water is equivalent to human beings, and “the clearness of water is equivalent to the goodness of human nature” (Yishu 1; 11). Through such an analogy, Cheng Hao attempts to show that, in addition to human nature, humans are endowed both internally with the host vital force, which is constitutive of human body, and externally with the alien vital force, which makes up the natural and social environment in which humans live. Therefore, not only is human nature all good, but the host vital force constitutive of human beings is also pure, clear, and balanced. Neither of the two can account for human evil. However, since human beings are corporeal beings, they must be born to and live in the midst of external vital force, which can be pure or impure. It is the quality of this external or guest vital force, purity or impurity, and the way people deal with it, that distinguishes between good and evil people. If the external vital force is also pure, it will provide the necessary nourishment to the internal vital force and therefore the original good human nature will not be damaged, and people will be good. If the external vital force is turbid and human beings living in it have not developed immunity to it, their internal vital force will be malnourished or even polluted and the original good human nature will be damaged, and people will be evil.

Thus, in Cheng Hao’s view, although both evil people and animals are endowed with muddy, mixed, and one-sided vital force, evil people are endowed with it externally as the necessary environment in which they have to live, while animals are endowed with it internally as constitutive of their bodily existence. In other words, such muddy, mixed, and one-sided vital force is the external guest vital force for human beings but is the internal host vital force for animals. Since the host vital force constitutive of animals – the vital force that makes animals animals – is muddy, mixed, and one-sided, animals can never be transformed into moral beings. On the other hand, since the host vital force constitutive of evil people, just as that constitutive of good people, is originally pure, clear, and balanced, but is only later polluted by muddy, mixed, and one-sided alien vital force, they can be made to become good by clearing up the pollution. Here, just as muddy water, when purified, does not enter into a state it has never been in before but simply returns to its original state of clearness, so an evil person, when made good, does not become an entirely new being, but simply returns to its original state of goodness (Yishu 1; 10-11). A return to this original state requires moral cultivation.

5. Moral Cultivation

Cheng Hao’s distinction between the host vital force and guest vital force makes a great contribution to the solution of the problem of the origin of evil. At least this is a step further than simply appealing to the distinction between principle and vital force. Still it is hard to say that it is completely successful, as it seems to attribute the origin of evil entirely to the external environment, which is also suggested by Mencius in his analogies of the growing of wheat (Mencius 6a7) and the Niu Mountain (Mencius 6a8). Some scholars believe such a view is implausible, and even both Cheng Hao and Mencius think that an evil person is also responsible for becoming bad. However, neither of them provides a satisfactory explanation about the internal origin of evil. Perhaps their very idea of the original goodness of human nature prevents such an explanation, just as Xunzi’s idea of the original badness of human nature perhaps prevents him from a satisfactory explanation of the origin of goodness: Xunzi does appeal to the transformative influence of sages and their teaching as a solution to the problem, but then he faces the problem of the origin of sages as their nature, as he claims, is also evil.

Whether Cheng Hao’s solution to the problem of the origin of evil is satisfactory or not, it is undeniable that one can become evil even though his or her nature is good. So Cheng Hao emphasizes the importance of moral cultivation. Since evil occurs when the turbid external vital force pollutes one’s originally clean internal vital force, just as the dust and dirt in the river makes the originally clear water muddy, what is needed is to purify the contaminated internal vital force, just as the turbid water must settle to become clear. This process is called cultivation of the vital force (yang qi) in Mencius. When the internal vital force is cultivated to the utmost, it becomes as clear, bright, pure, and complete as it is in its original state. This is also what Mencius calls “flood-like” vital force (haoran zhi qi), and so Cheng Hao puts a great emphasis on the passage of the Mencius in which Mencius talks about the cultivation of this flood-like vital force (Yishu 11; 117). Cheng Hao claims that “the flood-like vital force is nothing but my own [internally endowed] vital force. When it is cultivated instead of being harmed, it can fill between heaven and earth. Once it is blocked by private desires, however, it will immediately become withered” (Yishu 2a; 20). In other words, Mencius’ flood-like vital force is what everyone is originally internally endowed with, and everyone should cultivate it in case it gets contaminated by the turbid external vital force.

How does one cultivate the flood-like vital force? Cheng Hao claims that it does not come from outside. Rather it results from “consistent moral actions (jiyi)” (Yishu 2a; 29 and Yishu 11; 124). So jiyi becomes the way to cultivate the flood-like vital force. Thus, commenting on the passage in which Mencius talks about the flood-like vital force, Cheng Hao points out that, “cultivated straightly from dao and along the line of principle, it fills up between heaven and earth. [Mencius says that] ‘it is to be accompanied with rightness and dao,’ which means that it takes rightness as its master and never diverts from dao. [Mencius says that] ‘This is generated by consistent moral actions,’ which means that everything one does is in accordance with rightness” (Yishu 1; 11).

To say that cultivation of vital force consists in consistent moral actions, however, for Cheng Hao, does not mean that one has to exert artificial effort to do what is right, even though one does not have the inclination to do it. For this reason, he repeatedly cites Mencius’ claim that “while you must never let it out of your mind, you must not forcibly help it grow either” (Mencius 2a2). In other words, one has to set one’s mind on moral actions and yet cannot force such actions upon oneself. What is important for Cheng Hao is that, when one engages oneself in moral practices, one is not to regulate one’s action with the principle of rightness, as otherwise one will not be able to feel joy in it. In Cheng Hao’s view, this is a distinction best exemplified by the sage king Shun, who “practices from rightness and humanity” instead of “practicing rightness and humanity” (Yishu 3; 61). In other words, one cannot regard morality as external rules that constrain one’s action but as internal source that inclines one to act naturally, without effort, and at ease.

A person becomes evil because of the turbid external force. However, the turbid force can also make one evil because a person’s will is not firm. Thus another way of moral cultivation is to firm up one’s will (chi zhi). While cultivation of the vital force can help firming up one’s original good will, firming up one’s original good will can also help cultivate the vital force. Thus, referring to Mencius’ view about the relationship between these two, Cheng Hao states that, “for a person whose vital force is yet to be cultivated, the activity of the vital force may move one’s will, and the decision of one’s will may cause the movement of the vital force. However, to a person whose virtue is fulfilled, since the will is already firmed up, the vital force will not be able to change one’s will” (Yishu 1; 11). So in Cheng Hao’s view, to avoid being polluted by turbid vital force, it is important to firm up one’s will: “as soon as one’s will is firmed up, the vital force cannot cause any trouble” (Yishu 2b; 53). On the one hand, if one’s will is not firm, it may be disturbed by violent vital force; on the other hand, if one’s will is firm, the vital force cannot disturb it.

In order to firm up one’s will, Cheng Hao claims that it is most important to live in reverence (ju jing). The primary function of being in reverence is to overcome one’s selfish desires: “As soon as one has selfish desires, [one’s heart-mind] will wither, and the flood-like vital force will be lacking” (Yishu 2a; 29). To be reverent inside is to overcome selfish desires. As soon as these selfish desires are overcome, one will be like a sage, who “is happy with things because they are things one ought to be happy with, and is angry at things because they are things one ought to be angry at. The sage’s being happy or angry is thus according to things and not according to his own likes or dislikes” (Wenji 2; 461). This is because, in Cheng Hao’s view, the inborn virtues of sages and worthies are also complete in everyone’s original nature. Thus when not harmed, one need only practice straightly from the inside. If there is some damage, one must be reverent so that it can be purified and return to its original state (Yishu 1; 1).

These two ways of moral cultivation – cultivation of the vital force (yang qi), which relies upon consistent moral actions (jiyi), and firming up one’s will (chi zhi), which relies upon one’s being reverent (ju jin) – are what the Book of Chang calls “being reverent (jing) so that one’s inner [heart-mind] will be upright and being right (yi) so that one’s external [actions] will be in accord [with principle].” The former is internal and the latter is external. In Cheng Hao’s view, they are also the only ways to become a sage. One of the common features of these two methods is that they both aim at one’s virtues so that a virtuous person takes delight in being virtuous without making forced efforts (Yishu 2a; 20). Thus, just as he emphasizes “being reverent so that the inner will be straightened” (jing yi zhi nei) instead of “using reverence to straighten the inner” (yi jing zhi nei), he emphasizes “being morally right so that one’s external action will be squared” (yi yi fang wai) instead of “using rightness to square one’s external action” (yi yi fang wai) (Yishu 11; 120). (Although these two Chinese phrases appear identical in romanization, they contain different characters, as can be seen from their different translations.) Moreover, while the two ways can be respectively called internal way and external way, Cheng Hao emphasizes that it is important “to combine the inner way and the external way” (Yishu 1; 9). In other words, these two ways are not separate, as if one could practice one without practicing the other.

6. Influence

Han Yu (768-824), an important Tang dynasty Confucian, established a lineage of the Confucian tradition (daotong) from Yao, Shun, Yu, Tang, King Wen, King Wu, Duke of Zhou, Confucius, and Mencius. He claimed that, after Mencius, this lineage was interrupted. Cheng Yi accepted this Confucian daotong and claimed that his brother Cheng Hao was the first one to continue this lineage after Mencius (Wenji 11; 640). While there may be some exaggeration in such a claim, particularly as it is in the tomb inscription he wrote for his own brother, there is also truth in it. According to one widely accepted chronology, there are three epochs of Confucianism: pre-Qin Classical Confucianism, neo-Confucianism in the Song and Ming dynasties, and contemporary Confucianism. In the second stage, as far as neo-Confucianism can be characterized as the learning of principle, Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi can indeed be regarded as its true founders, and their learning, through their numerous students, to a large extent determined the later development of neo-Confucianism. While the two brothers share fundamentally similar views and most of these students learned from both, different students noticed and exaggerated their different emphases and thus developed different schools. Among all their students, Xie Liangzuo (1050-1103) and Yang Shi (1053-1135) are the most distinguished. Yang Shi transmitted Cheng Yi’s teaching through his student Luo Congyan (1072-1135) and the latter’s student Li Tong (1093-1163), to Zhu Xi. The synthesizer of the lixue school of neo-Confucianism, Xie Liangzuo transmitted Cheng Hao’s learning through a few generations of students such as Wang Ping (1082-1153) and Zhang Jiucheng (1092-1159) to Lu Jiuyuan (1139-1193) and eventually to Wang Yangming, the culminating figure of the xinxue school of neo-Confucianism. Sometimes a third school of neo-Confucianism, xingxue (learning of human nature), is identified, whose most important representative is Hu Hong (?-1161). Hu Hong continued the learning of his father, Hu Anguo (1074-1138), who in turn was also influenced by Xie Liangzuo. In this sense, Cheng Hao leaves his mark on all three main schools of neo-Confucianism (all recognized, in Chinese scholarship, as lixue, learning of principle, understood in the broad sense).

7. References and Further Reading

  • Bol, Peter. Neo-Confucianism in History. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Asia Center, 2008.
    • There are scattered discussions of Cheng Hao throughout the book.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit. A Source Book in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963.
    • Chapter 31 is the most extensive English translation of selected sayings and writings by Cheng Hao.
  • Chang, Carsun. The Development of Neo-Confucianism, vol. 1. New Haven, Conn.: College and University Press, 1957.
    • Chapter 9 is devoted to Cheng Hao.
  • Cheng, Hao & Cheng, Yi. Collected Works of the Two Chengs (Er Cheng Ji). Beijing: Zhonghua Shuju, 1988.
    • A collection of the works and sayings of Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi.
  • Fung, Yu-lan (Feng, Yulan). A History of Chinese Philosophy. Vol. II. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1953.
    • Chapter XII, Section 2, is a combined study of Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi.
  • Graham, A.C. Two Chinese Philosophers. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court, 1992.
    • The only book length study of Cheng Hao and Cheng Yi in English.
  • Hon, Tze-ki. “Cheng Hao.” In A. S. Cua, ed., Encyclopedia of Chinese Philosophy. New York: Routledge, 2003.
    • A full length article on Cheng Hao’s philosophy.
  • Hsu, Fu-kuan. “Chu Hsi and Cheng Brothers.” In Wing-tsit Chan, ed., Chu Hsi and Neo-Confucianism. Honolulu: University of Hawaii, 1986.
    • A study of the similarity and difference between Zhu Xi and the Cheng brothers.
  • Huang, Siu-chi. Essentials of Neo-Confucianism: Eight Major Philosophers of the Song and Ming Periods. Westport, Conn.: Greenwood Press, 1999.
    • One chapter is devoted to a philosophical study of Cheng Hao.
  • Huang, Yong. “Confucian Love and Global Ethics: How the Cheng Brothers Would Help Respond to Christian Criticisms.” Asian Philosophy 15/1 (2005): 35-60.
    • A discussion of the contemporary significance of the Cheng brothers’ interpretation of love with distinction.
  • Huang, Yong. “The Cheng Brothers’ Onto-Theological Articulation of Confucian Values.” Asian Philosophy 17/3 (2007): 187-211.
    • An interpretation of the Cheng brothers’ li as life-giving activity.
  • Huang, Yong. “Neo-Confucian Political Philosophy: The Cheng Brothers on Li (Propriety) as Political, Psychological, and Metaphysical.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 34/2 (2007): 217-239.
    • An exposition of the Cheng brothers’ li as rules of action, as one’s inner feeling, and as human nature.
  • Huang, Yong. “Why Be Moral? The Cheng Brothers’ Neo-Confucian Answer.” Journal of Religious Ethics 36/2 (2008): 321-353.
    • A discussion of the Cheng brothers’ conception of human nature as a response to the question of why be moral.
  • Wong, Wai-ying. “The Status of li in the Cheng Brothers’ Philosophy.” Dao: A Journal of Comparative Philosophy 3/1 (2003): 109-119.
    • An important study of the Cheng brothers’ conception of propriety.
  • Wong, Wai-ying. “Morally Bad in the Philosophy of the Cheng Brothers.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 36/1 (2009): 157-176.
    • A good discussion of the Cheng brothers’ view of evil.

Author Information

Yong Huang
Kutztown University of Pennsylvania
U. S. A.

Last updated: June 5, 2009 | Originally published: