Cheng Yi was one of the leading philosophers of Neo-Confucianism in the Song (Sung dynasty (960-1279). Together with his elder brother Cheng Hao (1032-1085), he strove to restore the tradition of Confucius and Mencius in the name of “the study of dao” (dao xue), which eventually became the main thread of Neo-Confucianism. Despite diverse disagreements between them, the two brothers are usually lumped together as the Cheng Brothers to signify their common contribution to Neo-Confucianism.
Cheng Yi asserted a transcendental principle (li) as an ontological substance. It is a principle that accounts for both the existence of nature and morality. He also asserted that human nature is identical with li and is originally good. The way of moral cultivation for Cheng Yi is through composure and extension of knowledge which is a gradual way towards sagehood. These ideas deviate from his brother’s philosophy as well as from Mencius’. They were developed into a school for the study of li (li xue), as a rival to the study of the mind (xin xue), which was initiated by Cheng Hao and inherited by Lu Xiangshan (1139-1193) and Wang Yangming (1472-1529). Cheng Yi’s thought had a great impact on Zhu Xi (1130-1200).
Cheng Yi, a native of Henan, was born into a family of distinguished officials. He used Zhengshu as courtesy name, but was much better known as Yichuan, the river in his home country. Cheng Yi grew up in Huangpo, where his father served as a local administrator. At fourteen, he and his elder brother were sent to study under the tutelage of Zhou Dunyi, the Song Dynasty’s founding father of Neo-Confucianism. At eighteen, driven by a strong sense of duty and concern for the nation, , he memorialized to the emperor a penetrating analysis of the current political crisis as well as the hardships of the common people. In 1056, led by his father, he and his brother traveled to Loyang, the capital, and enrolled in the imperial academy. There they made friends with Zhang Zai, who also eventually became a paragon of Neo-Confucianism.
With an excellent essay, Cheng Yi won the commendation of Hu Yuan, the influential educator, and he gained celebrity status in academia. Young scholars came to study with him from regions far and wide. In 1072, when Cheng Hao was dismissed from his government office, Cheng Yi organized a school with him and started his life-long career as a private tutor. Time and again he turned down offers of appointment in the officialdom. Nonetheless, he maintained throughout his life a concern for state affairs and was forthright in his strictures against certain government policies, particularly those from the reform campaign of Wang Anshi. As the reformers were ousted in 1085, Cheng Yi was invited by the emperor to give political lectures regularly. He did so for twenty months, until political attacks put an end to his office.
At the age of sixty, Cheng Yi drafted a book on the Yizhuan (Commentary on the Book of Changes) and laid plans for its revision and publication in ten years. In 1049, he finished the revision complete with a foreword. He then turned to annotate the Lunyu (Analects), the Mengzi (Mencius), the Liji (Record of Ritual) and the Chunqiu (Spring and Autumn Annals). In the following year he began working on the Chunqiu Zhuan (Commentary on Spring and Autumn Annals). However, in 1102, as the reformers regained control, he was impeached on charges of “evil speech.” As a result, he was prohibited from teaching, and his books were banned and destroyed. In 1109 he suffered a stroke. Sensing the imminent end of his life, he ignored the restriction on teaching and delivered lectures on his book Yizhuan. He died in September of that year.
Apart from the book mentioned above, Cheng Yi left behind essays, poems and letters. These are collected in Works of the Cheng Brothers (Er Cheng Ji), which also carries his conversations as recorded by his disciples. Works of the Cheng Brothers is an amended version of Complete Works of the Two Chengs (the earliest version was published during the Ming dynasty), which includes Literary Remains (Yishu), Additional Works (Waishu), Explanation of Classics (Jingshuo), Collections of Literary Works (Wenyi), Commentary on the Book of Change (Zhouyi Zhuan) and Selected Writings (Cuiyan). Reflections on Things at Hand (Jinsi lu) which was compiled by Zhu Xi (1130-1200) and Lu Zuqian (1137-1181), also collected many of Cheng Yi’s conversations.
The concept of li is central to Cheng Yi’s ontology. Although not created by the Cheng brothers, it attained a core status in Neo-Confucianism through their advocacy. Thus, Neo-Confucianism is also called the study of li (li xue). The many facets of li are translatable in English as “principle,” “pattern,” “reason,” or “law.” Sometimes it was used by the Chengs as synonymous with dao, which means the path. When so used, it referred to the path one should follow from the moral point of view. Understood as such, li plays an action-guiding role similar to that of moral laws. Apart from the moral sense, li also signifies the ultimate ground for all existence. This does not mean that li creates all things, but rather that li plays some explanatory role in making them the particular sorts of things they are. Therefore, li provides a principle for every existence. While Cheng Yi was aware that different things have different principles to account for their particular existence, he thought that these innumerable principles amounted to one principle. This one principle is the ultimate transcendental ground of all existence, which Zhu Xi later termed taiji (“great ultimate”) – the unitary basis of the dynamic, diverse cosmos. While the ultimate principle possesses the highest universality, the principle for a certain existence represents the specific manifestation of this ultimate principle. Therefore the latter can be understood as a particularization of the former.
Apparently for Cheng Yi, li is both the principle for nature and that for morality. The former governs natural matters; the latter, human affairs. To illustrate this with Cheng’s example, li is the principle by which fire is hot and water is cold. It is also the principle that regulates the relation between father and son, requiring that the father be paternal and the son be filial.
As the principle of morality, li is ontologically prior to human affairs. It manifests itself in an individual affair in a particular situation. Through one’s awareness, pre-existent external li develops into an internal principle within the human heart-mind (xin). On the other hand, as the principle of nature, li is also ontologically prior to a multitude of things. It manifests itself in the vital force (qi) of yin-yang. The relationship between li and yin-yang is sometimes misconstrued as one of identity or coextensivity, but Cheng Yi’s description of the relationship between the two clearly indicates otherwise.For him, li is not the same thing as yin-yang, but rather is what brings about the alternation or oscillation between yin and yang. Although li and qi belong to two different realms — namely, the realm “above form” (xing er shang) and the realm “below form” (xing er xia) — they cannot exist apart from one another. He clearly stated that, apart from yin-yang, there is no dao.
In summary, no matter whether as the principle of nature or that of morality, li serves as an expositional principle which accounts for what is and what should be from an ontological perspective. Therefore, as Mou Zongsan argued, for Cheng Yi, li does not represent an ever producing force or activity, as his brother Cheng Hao perceived, but merely an ontological ground for existence in the realm of nature as well as morality.
Human nature (xing) has been a topic of controversy since Mencius championed the view that human nature is good (xing shan). The goodness of human nature in this sense is called the “original good,” which signifies the capacity of being compassionate and distinguishing between the good and the bad. Cheng Yi basically adopted Mencius’ view on this issue and further provided an ontological ground for it. He claimed that human nature and dao are one, thus human nature is equivalent to li. Human nature is good since dao and li are absolute good, from which moral goodness is generated. In this way Cheng Yi elevated the claim that human nature is good to the level of an ontological claim, which was not so explicit in Mencius.
According to Cheng Yi, all actions performed from human nature are morally good. Presenting itself in different situations, human nature shows the different aspects of li — namely, humanity (ren), righteousness (yi), propriety (li), wisdom (qi), and trustworthiness (xin). (These five aspects of li also denote five aspects of human nature.) Human beings are able to love since ren is inherent in their nature. When the heart-mind of compassion is generated from ren, love will arise. Nevertheless, love belongs to the realm of feeling (qing) and therefore it is not human nature. (Neo-Confucians tended to regard human feelings as responses of human nature to external things.) Cheng Yi argued that we can be aware of the principle of ren inherent in us by the presentation of the heart-mind of compassion. Loyalty (zhong) and empathy (shu) are only feelings and, thus, they are not human nature. Because of ren, human beings are able to love, be loyal and be empathetic. Nevertheless, to love, in Cheng Yi’s words, is only the function (yong) of ren and to be empathetic is its application.
As a moral principle inherent in human nature, ren signifies impartiality. When one is practicing ren, one acts impartially, among other things. Ren cannot present itself but must be embodied by a person. Since love is a feeling, it can be right or wrong. It may be said that ren is the principle to which love should conform. In contrast to Cheng Hao’s theory that ren represents an ever producing and reproducing force, ren for Cheng Yi is only a static moral principle.
Ren, understood as a moral principle that has the same ontological status as li or dao, is a substance (ti) while feeling of compassion or love is a function. Another function of ren consists in filial piety (xiao) and fraternal duty (ti). These have been regarded by Chinese people as cardinal virtues since the time of the early Zhou dynasty. It was claimed in the Analects that filial piety and fraternal duty are the roots of ren. However, Cheng Yi gave a re-interpretation by asserting that filial piety and fraternal duty are the roots of practicing ren. Again, this shows that for Cheng Yi, ren is a principle, and filial piety and fraternal duty are only two of the ways of actualizing it. When one applies ren to the relationship of parents and children, one will act as filial, and to the relationship between siblings, one will act fraternally. Moreover, Cheng Yi considered filial piety and fraternal duty the starting points of practicing ren.
Having said that ren is substance whereas love, filial piety, and fraternal duty are its functions, it should be noted that according to Cheng Yi the substance cannot activate itself and reveal its function. The application of ren mentioned above merely signifies that the mind and feeling of a person should conform to ren in dealing with various relationships or situations. This is what the word “static” used in the previous paragraph means. Thus understood, ren as an aspect of human nature deviates from Mencius’ perception, as well as the perception in The Doctrine of the Mean (Zhong Yong) and the Commentary of the Book of Change, as Mou Zongsan pointed out. Mou also argued that the three sources mentioned have formed a tradition of understanding dao both as a substance and as an activity. Not surprisingly, Cheng Yi’s view on human nature and li is quite different from his brother Cheng Hao’s.
By the same token, other aspects in human nature such as righteousness, propriety, wisdom and trustworthiness are mere principles of different human affairs. One should seek conformity with these principles in dealing with issues in ordinary life.
The duality of li and qi in Cheng Yi’s ontology also finds expression in his ethics, resulting in the tripartite division of human nature, human mind and human feeling. In Cheng Yi’s ethics, the mind of a human being does not always conform to his nature; therefore a human sometimes commits morally bad acts. This is due to the fact that human nature belongs to the realm of li and the mind and feelings belong to the realm of qi. Insofar as the human mind is possessed by desires which demand satisfaction, it is regarded as dangerous. Although ontologically speaking li and qi are not separable, desires and li contradict one another. Cheng Yi stressed that only when desires are removed can li be restored. When this happens, Cheng maintained, the mind will conform to li, and it will transform from a human mind (ren xin) to a mind of dao (dao xin). Therefore, human beings should cultivate the human mind in order to facilitate the above transformation. For Cheng Hao, however, li is already inherent in one’s heart-mind, and one only needs to activate one’s heart-mind for it to be in union with li. The mind does not need to seek conformity with li to become a single entity, as Cheng Yi suggested. It is evident that the conception of the mind in Cheng Yi’s ethics also differs from that in Mencius’ thought. Mencius considered the heart-mind as the manifestation of human nature, and if the former is fully activated, the latter will be fully actualized. For Mencius, the two are identical. Yet for Cheng Yi, li is identical with human nature but lies outside the mind. This difference of the two views later developed into two schools in Neo-Confucianism: the study of li (li xue) and the study of xin (xin xue). The former was initiated by Cheng Yi and developed by Zhu Xi and the latter was initiated by Cheng Hao and inherited by Lu Xiangshan (1139-1193) and Wang Yangming.
According to Cheng Yi, every being comes into existence through the endowment of qi. A person’s endowment contains various qualities of qi, some good and some bad. These qualities of qi are described in terms of their being “soft” or “hard,” “weak” or “strong,” and so forth. Since the human mind belongs to the realm of qi, it is liable to be affected by the quality of qi, and evil (e) will arise from the endowment of unbalanced and impure allotments of qi.
Qi is broadly used to account for one’s innate physical and mental characteristics. Apart from qi, the native endowment (cai) would also cause evil. Compared to qi, cai is more specific and refers to a person’s capacity for both moral and non-moral pursuits. Cai is often translated as “talent.” It influences a person’s moral disposition as well as his personality. Zhang Zai coined a term “material nature” (qizhi zhi xing), to describe this natural endowment. Although Cheng Yi adopted the concept of material nature, A.C. Graham noted that the term appeared only once in the works of the Cheng Brothers as a variant for xingzhi zhi xing. Nevertheless, this variant has superseded the original reading in many texts. Cheng Yi thought that native endowment would incline some people to be good and others to be bad from early childhood. He used an analogy to water in order to illustrate this idea: some water flows all the way to the sea without becoming dirty, but some flows only a short distance and becomes extremely turbid. Yet the water is the same. Similarly, the native endowment of qi could be pure or not. However, Cheng Yi emphasized that although the native endowment is a constraint on ordinary people transforming, they still have the power to override this endowment as long as they are not self-destructive (zibao) or in self-denial (ziqi). Cheng Yi admitted that the tendency to be self-destructive or in self-denial is also caused by the native endowment. However, since such people possess the same type of human nature as any others, they can free themselves from being self-destructive or in self-denial. Consequently Cheng Yi urged people to make great efforts to remove the deviant aspects of qi which cause the bad native endowment and to nurture one’s qi to restore its normal state. Once qi is adjusted, no native endowment will go wrong.
As mentioned in the previous section, Cheng Yi maintained that human desires are also the origin of selfishness, which leads to evil acts. The desires which give rise to moral badness need not be a self-indulgent kind. Since they are by nature partial, one will err if one is activated by desire. Any intention with the slightest partiality will obscure one’s original nature; even the “flood-like qi” described by Mencius (Mengzi 2A2) will collapse. The ultimate aim of moral practice is then to achieve sagehood where one will do the obligatory things naturally without any partial intention.
The Cheng brothers wrote, “It lacks completeness to talk about human nature without referring to qi and it lacks illumination to talk about qi without referring to human nature.” Cheng Yi’s emphasis on the influence of qi on the natural moral dispositions well reflects this saying. He put considerable weight on the endowment of qi; nevertheless, the latter by no means playsa deterministic role in moral behavior.
For Cheng Yi, to live with composure (ju jing) is one of the most important ways for cultivating the mind in order to conform with li. Jing appeared in the Analects as a virtue, which Graham summarized as “the attitude one assumes towards parents, ruler, spirits; it includes both the emotion of reverence and a state of self-possession, attentiveness, concentration.” It is often translated as “reverence” or “respect.” Hence in the Analects, respect is a norm which requires one to collect oneself and be attentive to a person or thing. Respect necessarily takes a direct object. Cheng Yi interpreted jing as the unity of the mind, and Graham proposed “composure” as the translation. As Graham put it, for Cheng Yi, composure means “making unity the ruler of the mind” (zhu yi). What is meant by unity is to be without distraction. In Cheng Yi’s own words, if the mind goes neither east nor west, then it will remain in equilibrium. When one is free from distraction, one can avoid being distressed by confused thoughts. Cheng Yi said that unity is called sincerity (cheng). To preserve sincerity one does not need to pull it in from outside. Composure and sincerity come from within. One only needs to make unity the ruling consideration, and then sincerity will be preserved. If one cultivates oneself according to this way, eventually li will become plain. Understood as such, composure is a means for nourishing the mind. Cheng Yi clearly expressed that being composed is the best way for a human being to enter into dao.
Cheng Yi urged the learner to cultivate himself by “being composed and thereby correcting himself within.” Furthermore, he indicated that merely by controlling one’s countenance and regulating one’s thought, composure will come spontaneously. It is evident that controlling one’s countenance and regulating one’s thought is an empirical way of correcting oneself within. Such a way matches the understanding of the mind as an empirical mind which belongs to qi. Mou Zongsan pointed out that this way of cultivating the empirically composed mind is quite different from Mencius’ way of moral cultivation. For the latter, the cultivation aims at the awareness of the moral heart-mind, a substance identical with Heaven. Since the mind and li are not identical in Cheng Yi’s philosophy, they are two entities even though one has been cultivating one’s mind for a long time, and what one can hope to achieve is merely always to be in conformity with li.
To achieve the ultimate goal of apprehending li, Cheng Yi said, one should extend one’s knowledge (zhi zhi) by investigating matters (ge wu). The conception of extending knowledge by investigating matters originates from the Great Learning (Da Xue), where the eight steps of practicing moral cultivation by the governor who wanted to promote morality throughout the kingdom were illustrated. Cheng Yi expounded the idea in “the extension of knowledge lies in the investigation of things” in the Great Learning by interpreting the key words in “the investigation of matters.” The word “investigation” (ge) means “arrive at” and “matters” (wu) means “events.” He maintained that in all events there are principles (li) and to arrive at those principles is ge wu. No matter whether the events are those that exist in the world or within human nature, it is necessary to investigate their principles to the utmost. That means one should, for instance, investigate the principle by which fire is hot and that by which water is cold, also the principles embodied in the relations between ruler and minister, father and son, and the like. Thus understood, the investigation of things is also understood as exhausting the principles (qiong li). Cheng Yi emphasized that these principles are not outside of, but already within, human nature.
Since for every event there is a particular principle, Cheng Yi proposed that one should investigate each event in order to comprehend its principle. He also suggested that it is profitable to investigate one event after another, day after day, as after sufficient practice, the interrelations among the principles will be evident. Cheng Yi pointed out that there are various ways to exhaust the principles, for instance, by studying books and explaining the moral principles in them; discussing prominent figures, past and present, to distinguish what is right and wrong in their actions; experiencing practical affairs and dealing with them appropriately.
Cheng Yi rejected the idea that one should exhaust all the events in the world in order to exhaust the principles. This might appear to conflict with the proposition that one should investigate into each event, yet the proposal can be understood as “one should investigate into each event that one happens to encounter.” Cheng Yi claimed that if the principle is exhausted in one event, for the rest one can infer by analogy. This is possible is due to the fact that innumerable principles amount to one.
From the above exposition of Cheng Yi’s view on the investigations of matters, the following implication can be made. First, the knowledge obtained by investigating matters is not empirical knowledge. Cheng Yi was well aware of the distinction between the knowledge by observation and the knowledge of morals as initially proposed by Zhang Zai. The former is about the relations among different matters and therefore is gained by observing matters in the external world. The latter cannot be gained by observation. Since Cheng Yi said that the li exhausted by investigating matters is within human nature, it cannot be obtained by observation, and thus is not any kind of empirical knowledge.
This may be confusing, but if we compare Cheng Yi’s kind of knowledge to scientific knowledge, things may become clearer. It is important to distinguish between the means one uses to get knowledge, and the constituents of that knowledge. One uses observation as a means to better understand the nature of external things. But the knowledge one gains isn’t observational by nature. It isn’t the sort of knowledge scientists have in mind when they say “objects with mass are drawn toward one another.” It differs in at least two respects: first, the content of one’s knowledge is something we can draw from ourselves, as we have the same li in our nature; second, the knowledge we gain doesn’t rest on the authority of observations. We know it without having to put our trust in external observations, since the knowledge is drawn from inside ourselves. We only need external observation in order to liberate this internal knowledge. So we need it as a means, but no more.
Second, according to Cheng Yi, investigating matters literally means arriving at an event. It implies that the investigation is undertaken in the outside world where the mind will be in contact with the event. Only through the concrete contact with the eventis the act of knowing concretely carried out and the principles can be exhausted.
Third, Cheng Yi believed that through the investigation of matters the knowledge obtained is the knowledge of morals. When one is in contact with an event, one will naturally apprehend the particulars of the event and the knowledge by observation will thus form. Nevertheless, in order to gain the knowledge of morals one should not stick to those concrete particulars but go beyond to apprehend the transcendental principle which accounts for the nature and morals. Thus, the concrete events are only necessary means to the knowledge of morals. They themselves are not constituents of the knowledge in question, as Mou Zongsan argued.
According to Cheng Yi, learning to be an exemplary person (junzi) lies in self-reflection. Self-reflection in turn lies in the extension of knowledge. Also, only by self-reflection can one transform the knowledge by observation into the knowledge of morals. This is possible only if the mind is cultivated in the maintenance of composure. With composure in place, one can apprehend the transcendental principles of events. Cheng Yi made a remark on this idea: “It is impossible to extend the knowledge without composure.” This also explains the role composure plays in obtaining the knowledge of morals by investigating matters.
Contrariwise, obtaining the knowledge of morals can stabilize the composed mind and regulate concrete events to be in conformity with li. Cheng Yi described this gradual stabilization of the mind by accumulating moral knowledge as “collecting righteousness (ji yi).”
Self-reflection for Cheng Yi meant cultivating the mind with composure. However, as mentioned above, the mind cannot be identical with li; it can only conform to it since they belong to two different realms. Since the knowledge obtained by the composed mind comprises the transcendental principles, the knowing in question is a kind of contemplative act. Notwithstanding that, this act still represents a subject-object mode of knowing. On the contrary, the meaning of self-reflection for Mencius reveals a different dimension. The knowledge of morals gained by self-reflection is not any principle which the mind should follow. The knowing is an awareness of the moral mind itself through which its identification with human nature and also with li is revealed. Therefore the object of knowing is not the principle out there (inherent in human nature though) but the knowing mind itself. The awareness thus is a self-awareness. The reflection understood as such is not the cognition per se; it is rather the activation of the mind. In the act of activation, the dichotomy of the knowing and the known diminishes. Moreover, when the mind is activated, human nature is actualized and li will manifest itself. Hence, the mind is aware of itself being a substance, from which li is created. Here Cheng Yi draws upon the distinction between a thing’s substance, understood as its essential and inactive state, and the active state in which it behaves in characteristic ways. Anticipating that his account of the mind will be misread as suggesting that the mind has two parts — an active and inactive part — Cheng Yi clarifies that he understands the two parts to be, in fact, two aspects of one and the same thing.
The distinctive and influential ideas in Cheng Yi’s thought can be summarized as follows:
Cheng Yi had tremendous impact on the course of Confucian philosophy after his time. His influence is most manifest, however, in the thought of the great Neo-Confucian synthesizer Zhu Xi, who adopted and further developed the views outlined above.
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Last updated: October 10, 2009 | Originally published: