Between 1931 and 1935, important debates regarding the nature, possibility and history of Christian philosophy took place between major authors in French-speaking philosophical and theological circles. These authors include Etienne Gilson, Jacques Maritain, Maurice Blondel, Gabriel Marcel, Fernand Van Steenberghen and Antonin Sertillanges. The debates provided occasion for participants to clarify their positions on the relationships between philosophy, Christianity, theology and history, and they involved issues such as the relationship between faith and reason, the nature of reason, reason’s grounding in the concrete human subject, the problem of the supernatural, and the nature and ends of philosophy itself. The debates led participants to self-consciously re-evaluate their own philosophical commitments and address the problem of philosophy’s nature in a novel and rigorous manner.
Although these debates originally took place between Roman Catholics and secular Rationalists, fundamental differences between different Roman Catholic positions rapidly became apparent and assumed central importance. The debates also drew attention from Reformed Protestant thinkers. Eventually the debates sparked smaller discussions among scholars in English, German, Spanish, Portuguese and Italian-speaking circles, and these continue to the present day. This article provides a brief overview of the most important contributors, the central issues and the main positions of these debates.
The use of the term “Christian philosophy” and other similar expressions dates back to the early Christian era. However, considerable ambiguity surrounding the term pervades philosophical reflection regarding Christian philosophy’s possibility, historical reality and nature, and therefore affects efforts to generate and evaluate particular Christian philosophies. The 1930s French Debates represent a period of the most sustained and systematic examination of the problems concerning Christian philosophy, and are thus of philosophical significance for various reasons.
First, they involve perennial issues raised in philosophy, including the relationships between faith and reason, philosophy and theology, the nature of human reason and its limits in the face of religion, the nature of religion, historical relationships between Christian thought, practice and the development of particular philosophical systems and the nature of philosophy itself. The debates led participants to self-consciously re-evaluate their own philosophical commitments and address the problem of philosophy’s nature in a novel and rigorous manner.
Second, the debates are momentous due to the renown of their participants, most of whom had earned significant places in Francophone philosophical establishments, both secular or Christian. Practically all of the major interlocutors approached the issues armed with years of previous study, reflection and in some cases polemical engagements. Each of them was thus able to develop further insights and to more systematically elaborate their positions during the ensuing debates on the basis of their previous philosophical work.
Third, the debates and their participants’ personal positions on Christian philosophy have generated an ever-growing philosophical literature. Given that issues germane to Christian philosophy had never before nor since been examined so thoroughly, contemporary discussions regarding Christian philosophy greatly benefit from the 1930s Debates.
Without providing a comprehensive historic overview for the 1930s Debates, several historical developments allowing context are to be considered at this juncture.
The onset of modernity produced radically new schools of philosophical thought, increasingly secularized culture, institutions, disciplines and discourses, and in some cases suspicion or outright repudiation of previous philosophical and theological traditions, religious authority and of Christianity itself. While issues raised by the contact between Christianity and philosophy were addressed in late antiquity, the “problem of Christian philosophy” was not explicitly framed until these developments came about. Thus Christian philosophy became a central problem for 17th and 18th century thinkers such as Pascal, Malebranche, Descartes, Hegel, Kierkegaard, Catholic Traditionalists (such as de Maistre and Lammenais), neo-Scholastics and other Thomists, and Maurice Blondel.
Another major development stemmed from the impetus given to Catholic philosophical work by several papal encyclicals. Leo XIII’s Aeterni Patris dealt explicitly with the relationship between philosophy and Christianity, and exhorted the return to study of Thomas Aquinas. While it never made Thomism the official philosophy of the Roman Catholic Church, it gave pride of place to Aquinas’ work, and within a generation Thomist philosophy became established as the dominant and representative form of Catholic philosophical thought. Aeterni Patris also had the side-effect of encouraging renewed attention to other mediaeval Christian thinkers, including Augustine, Anselm, Bonaventure, Scotus and Ockham. During the Modernism crisis, Pius X’s Pascendi exerted a different effect. The document diagnosed philosophical bases of the heresy of “modernism” and reinforced the centrality to be accorded to Thomism. With respect to Christian philosophy, the two documents might be summarized thus: the first suggested where Christian philosophy should be found and further developed; the second indicated where Christian philosophy could not be found and further developed.
Furthermore, in France a revitalization had taken place in metaphysics, moral philosophy and philosophical anthropology (all areas, as Etienne Gilson pointed out, central to Christian philosophy), due in part to renewed interest in Thomist and Augustinian studies and also to the influence of Henri Bergson and Maurice Blondel. In addition, the term “Christian philosophy” began to enjoy greater currency in the early part of the 20th century, particularly by the 1920s. This engendered two main lines of thought. First, the Debates provoked counter-responses by both secular, rationalist philosophers and by Catholic, neo-Scholastic philosophers who agreed for different reasons that the notion of Christian philosophy was a false one. Second, they produced reflection and dialogue on the part of Catholic and Reformed Protestant philosophers who considered the term to designate a distinctively Christian manner of philosophizing. By the time the debates officially began at the March 1931 meeting of the Société Française de Philosophie, the issue was primed for sustained discussion by the Francophone philosophical and theological communities.
Several participants had articulated their views on Christian philosophy prior to the debates. Emile Bréher dismissed the idea of Christian philosophy in relevant portions of his History of Philosophy, and in 1928 presented his argument at a set of conferences in Belgium. Etienne Gilson published books on Augustine, Bonaventure and Aquinas, making use of the term “Christian philosophy.” Along with Blondel and Jacques Maritain, she contributed discussions of Christian philosophy to various works commemorating the 1,500 year anniversary of the death of Augustine.
The specific catalyst for the debates was Xavier Leon’s proposal to Gilson that he and Léon Brunscvicg should debate the status of Thomist philosophy as a philosophy. Gilson in return proposed the broader topic “Christian philosophy”, asking that Brehier be included. Maritain also participated, taking Gilson’s side. Blondel contributed a letter highly critical of Gilson’s position at the meeting, and published a response to Bréhier’s criticisms.
The Debates expanded in numerous forums over the next four years. Articles and conference contributions by around fifty different authors appeared in journals, at first mainly in French, then later in German, Italian, Spanish, English and even Latin. Gilson, Maritain, Blondel and Regis Jolivet each published books focused on Christian philosophy in 1931-33. The Société Thomiste devoted their 1933 conference to the topic of Christian philosophy, and the Société d’Etudes Philosophiques devoted theirs that same year to discussion of Blondel’s Le problème de la philosophie chrétienne. By around 1936, the Debates came to a close. Although they did not end in conclusive or universally acknowledged success for any of the participants, the positions of dominant schools of thought regarding Christian philosophy had been firmly established.
The issue of Christian philosophy has continued to spur philosophical reflection, taking literary form in conference presentations, articles, books and papal documents (e.g. John Paul II’s Fides et Ratio and Benedict XVI’s recent Regensburg address on Faith, Reason and the University) and motivating a number of conferences and special journal volumes devoted to the topic. One smaller and later set of debates worth noting took place in the late 1940s and early 50s among Francophone Reformed Protestant philosophers and theologians, inspired by Roger Mehl’s The Condition of the Christian Philosopher, and included several Reformed thinkers who had played minor roles in the 1930s debates – Jacques Bois, Pierre Guérin and Arnold Reymond.
Etienne Gilson provides a useful overview and typology of the positions opposed to the possibility of Christian philosophy, distinguishing three main stances: “theologism” (now more generally called “fideism”), “rationalism” and certain types of Neo-Scholasticism.
Gilson had originally singled out “certain doctors of the Middle Ages” as representatives of theologism, for whom
the Christian religion excludes philosophy, because Christianity is a doctrine of salvation, because one can be saved without philosophy, and even because it is more difficult to be saved with philosophy than without it. . . . Medieval philosophy was the negation of this obscurantism, but still it did exist. For men of that type, the very notion of Christian philosophy could only rest on an equivocation. It signifies that where Christianity is, it is useless or dangerous that philosophy be. (Bulletin de la Société française de Philosophie, p. 41)
Gilson also criticizes another position regarding “theologism” (The Unity of Philosophical Experience, p.31-60): this is one where the term “Christian philosophy” signifies Christian revelation or Christian theology, disregarding the distinct role, discipline and methods of philosophy. In certain respects the rationalist position mirrors the theologist one:
[W]here philosophy is, it is dangerous that Christianity should be. This is the position of pure rationalism, i.e., of those who do not accept a limited role for rationalism. Whatever the content may be of the diverse philosophies reason elaborates, it is insofar as rational that they are philosophies. To want to subordinate them to a dogma or to a faith is to destroy philosophy’s essence….[T]heology bases itself on faith, which is something irrational. To make philosophy the servant of theology is therefore to make the rational depend on the irrational, i.e, to suppress its very rationality. (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 41)
At their root, rationalist positions on Christian philosophy, on one ground or another, eliminate or exclude from the field of philosophy any philosophical system, doctrine or author who brings reason, the instrument of philosophy, into contaminating contact with religious faith, practice, or thought, which would vitiate the philosophy’s rational and autonomous development. Numerous philosophical positions, schools, or even environments of basic cultural and philosophical presuppositions developed during or in the wake of the European Enlightenment fit rationalism’s profile. Arguably, even philosophies critical of the Enlightenment but devotedly committed to a necessarily secularist view of philosophy can, on the issue of Christian philosophy, be regarded as analogues of rationalism.
From rationalist perspectives, Patristic and Medieval thought, as well as those of their modern interpreters, would not legitimately deserve the title of philosophy. Gilson notes, however, holding that “everything that either directly or indirectly undergoes the influence of a religious faith ceases, ipso facto, to retain any philosophical value,” really stems from and represents “a mere ‘rationalist’ postulate, directly opposed to reason.” (The Spirit of Medieval Philosophy, p. 406)
Despite their differences, Neo-Thomist or neo-Scholastic opponents of Christian philosophy also shared several key similarities with rationalists. As Gilson points out, neo-Scholastics retain some role for Christian faith, but one extrinsic to their philosophical activity:
[A]ll of them agree with Saint Thomas that truth cannot contradict truth and that, consequently, what faith finds agrees substantially with what reason proves. They would even go further, for if faith agrees with reason, if not in its method, at least in its content, all factual disagreement between the two is an indication of an error in the philosophical order and a warning that one has to reexamine the problem. Still, all of the neo-Scholastic philosophers add that, insofar as philosophy, philosophy is the exclusive work of reason. (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 42)
The philosophy of the Christian, in their view, ought not to incorporate anything deriving from Christianity into itself, for then it passes over into theology. The neo-Scholastic position in effect adopts wholesale rationalist assumptions about human reason, philosophy and Christian faith, with the consequence that
[a]ccording to these neo-Scholastic philosophers, there cannot be Christian philosophy any more than there can be for a pure rationalist, because within the philosophical order, grasped with precision and insofar as philosophical, their rationalism is a pure one. (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 42)
No thinker ascribing to Gilson’s description of theologism participated in the debates, with the possible exception of Lev Shestov, whose 1937 Athens and Jerusalem (a portion of which was published in 1935) may be described as advancing theologism. Still, fideism exercised a role in the debates by providing a counter-position to argue against. Gilson himself cited a number of past examples, including Tertullian, Peter Damian, the Franciscan spirituals, the Imitation of Christ’s anonymous author, Martin Luther and briefly discussed Karl Barth (Christianity and Philosophy, p. 44-48), remarking: “All the Barthian Calvinist asks of philosophy is that it recognize itself as damned and remain in that condition” (Christianity and Philosophy, p. 47).
Barth exercised considerable influence in Francophone Reformed Christian circles, and his thought would figure heavily in later 1940s-50s Reformed Protestant discussions about Christian philosophy, but he was not particularly well-known or engaged in French Catholic circles at the time of the debates. His perspective on philosophy and Christianity is clearly and rigorously fideist, holding that Christian philosophy is an impossibility since philosophy and Christian Revelation have essentially nothing in common. Philosophy, like human reason, remains fundamentally incapable of addressing an absolutely transcendent Christian revelation of Christ, which alone provides knowledge of and relation to God:
There never actually has been a philosophia christiana, for if it was philosophia it was not christiana, and if it was christiana it was not philosophia. (Church Dogmatics, v. 1 , p. 6)
The existentialist Jewish philosopher Lev Shestov provides an example of the theologist position, in which his central metaphor is the opposition (stemming from the Genesis narrative) between the Tree of Life, representing faith and human thought working by the guidance of faith, and the Tree of Knowledge of Good and Evil, identified with the temptations of human reason and philosophy. According to Shestov, important and basic dimensions of human existence are left behind, reductively misconstrued, or overlooked by reason and philosophy. By aiming at and striving for knowledge, philosophy attempts to draw everything into a rationalist universal system of necessity and restraint. Even when making autonomy a goal, philosophy turns out to be unable to maintain itself and its drive to dominate all it encounters within limits, so that it corrupts and distorts human freedom and renders the human being unable to adequately understand itself, God and faith.
Shestov criticizes Gilson specifically, summarizing the latter’s position as proposing
the revealed truth is founded on nothing, proves nothing, is justified before nothing, and – despite this – is transformed in our mind into a justified, demonstrated, self-evident truth. Metaphysics wishes to possess the revealed truth and it succeeds in doing so. (Athens and Jerusalem, p.271)
Shestov regards Gilson’s position on Christian philosophy, and those of the Medieval thinkers from whom Gilson takes inspiration, as more sophisticated, and therefore more dangerous, versions of the same rationalist movement involved in ancient and modern philosophy. As an alternative, he proposes a “Biblical” or “Judeo-Christian philosophy,” departing from norms of Western philosophy, accepting “neither the fundamental problems nor the principles nor the technique of thought of rational philosophy,” open to and taking its direction from the dimension of faith.
Two major representatives of the rationalist position, the historian of philosophy Emile Bréhier, and the idealist Léon Brunschvicg, became directly involved in the Debates. Interestingly, while both argued against the possibility of Christian philosophy, their positions differed on basic assumptions about rationality. After presenting his position prior to and early on in the debates, Bréhier never provided responses to the arguments of his critics. In his later Raison et Religion, Brunchscvicg revisited the issues, but made no new contribution. By the middle stages of the Debates, the rationalists dropped out of the discussion, which had turned to intra-Christian (primarily intra-Catholic) issues.
Bréhier’s concluded that “one can no more speak of a Christian philosophy than of a Christian mathematics or a Christian physics,” (“Y-a-t’il une philosophie chrétienne?”, p. 162) arriving at this via two main argumentative strategies. Before examining these, two points bearing on Bréhier’s contribution to the debate require mention. First, Bréhier suggests that “the difficulty here is more normative than factual,” and then writes decisively “[t]he question of the existence of Christian philosophy can not be a pure question of fact.” (“Y-a-t’il”, p. 133-4). Judgment and resolution requires the historian’s active work of interpreting and discerning the philosophical value and content of candidates for the legitimate title of Christian philosophy. Second, he identifies reason, and rationality as such, with an idealization of Greek philosophy:
For the Hellene, the true object of philosophy was to discover order, or the cosmos: each being (and principally the directive forces of nature, souls, and God) must be defined by the exact, and ne varietur, place that it occupies in this eternal order. (“Y-a-t’il”, p. 134)
[T]he goal of Greek philosophy was to investigate the rational, consequently immovable and fixed, order which is in things. The universal Logos or Intelligence is only the metaphysical realization, the projection of this need. It is, set up within the ideal, the very order that the sensible world realizes more or less imperfectly. (“Y-a-t’il”, p. 139-40)
Bréhier’s first argumentative strategy took the form of a dilemma: there are two possible ways of understanding Christian philosophy, and adopting either one of these will lead to a rejection of Christian philosophy as philosophy:
The word “Christian philosophy” seems to me to have two extremely distinct senses….In a first sense, it exists, but it is of no interest to philosophers; in a second sense, it would have interest for philosophers if it did exist, but it does not exist. (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 49)
In the first sense, Christianity is determined by some dogmatic authority, termed by Bréhier a “magisterium.”
[T]he only way to know what is Christian and what is not Christian is to consult those who say – and who have the right to say – what Christian doctrine is….In this sense, I will call “Christian philosophy” that which is in agreement with dogma, what the magisterium accepts. I will call “non-Christian philosophy” that which it rejects, and I will say that this question has not a bit of importance or interest for the philosopher as philosopher. (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 50)
He provides two main and related reasons why the philosopher may set this question aside. Besides the fact of the existence of numerous Christian communities disagreeing on fundamental issues, the history of the Catholic magisterium reveals
an absence of precise limit in the philosophical domain this magisterium oversees, and a lack of consistency in its censure, and these make Christian philosophy in the first sense seem to be something completely arbitrary. (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 50)
In addition, the mere condition of reason and philosophy being forced in its exercise to submit to any authority sets
in place of the autonomy of reason that takes the initiative of philosophical thought, the heteronomy of a reason completely incapable of directing itself and knowing the scope of its own conclusions. (“Y-a-t’il”, p. 150)
This irredeemably vitiates any Christian philosophy understood in the first sense.
In the second sense, Christian philosophy would be a historically observable case where Christianity has provided to philosophy a new concept, method or direction. Arguing against this, Bréhier examined the thought of the Church Fathers, Augustine, Thomas Aquinas, 17th Century Rationalists, 19th Century Traditionalists, Hegel and his successors, and Maurice Blondel, to show that none of them are both Christian and philosophical. The Church Fathers do not create a new philosophy, but rather “annex everything they can from pagan philosophy to Christianity” (“Y-a-t’il”, p. 135). What is philosophical in Augustine really comes from Plato and Plotinus, and likewise Aquinas’ philosophy is simply Aristotelianism, though marred by an additional problem:
Saint Thomas’ goal is to show the convergence of the two great movements that dominate the spiritual history of our West, Greek rationalism represented by Aristotle and Christian faith. One can only speak of convergence if each of these two movements has its own initiative, its own internal development: but, reason no longer possesses its own initiative once the results of its own activity are judged by a criterion that is foreign to it, by faith (“Y-a-t’il”, p. 144).
The 17th Century Rationalists develop a natural theology, but in the process dispense with any distinctive dependence on Christianity, while the Traditionalists render reason so entirely dependent on Christianity that
If ‘reason’ still retains some value, it is under the condition of not wanting to be anything more than a form of tradition, and its oldest aspect. This Christian philosophy, the better to dominate reason, annexes it thus into revelation (“Y-a-t’il”, p. 156)
Hegelianism rationalizes religion by absorbing it into philosophy, and eventually culminates in Feuerbach’s philosophical but atheist humanism. Bréhier then brings his review to a close in criticizing Blondel on two counts. First, the problem of action central to Blondel’s work has no intrinsic connection with Christianity. Second, Blondel’s work is really just an example of Christian apologetics rather than philosophy.
In contrast to Bréhier’s wholesale and unconvincing dismissal of any historical influence of Christianity on philosophy, Brunschvicg provides a more nuanced, though still largely negative, perspective on Christian philosophy. While acknowledging from the start that “I would not recognize myself in what I think and what I feel if the entire movement of Christianity had not existed,” (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 73) he would sharpen the debates’ question into that of “a specifically Christian philosophy” (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 73). His answer takes form within the general assumptions of Brunschvicg’s evolutionary and idealist philosophy of rationality’s development.
In his view, rationality and philosophy emerge from originally religious backgrounds, but become progressively freed from religion and immature forms of rationality. True spirituality is to be discovered in philosophy, since religion and religious thought provide only its symbols.
[W]e come back to the position that I have called, granted very naively, that of the Western consciousness, which is prior by five centuries to the blossoming of Christianity. From that point of view, faith, insofar as faith, is only the prefiguration, the sensible symbol, the approximation of what properly human effort will be able to set in full light. We understand then how one can recognize that philosophy exists, and Christianity exists, without having the right to conclude that a Christian philosophy would exist (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 74-5).
Brunschvicg’s rationalist perspective eliminates one key aspect of the problem Christian philosophy poses for his Christian interlocutors. He holds that revelation is not really revelation, since what philosophy’s gradually ascending progress has revealed is that there is in reality no supernatural: Christian or otherwise. He also eliminates from consideration all pre-17th century philosophies as candidates for Christian philosophy, arguing that from the vantage of the present, the types of rationality developed prior to the 17th century were immature, and thus not adequately philosophical. Significantly, while this would disqualify Augustine’s or Aquinas’ thought (though not Hegel’s or Blondel’s) from being Christian philosophies, it would likewise disqualify the ancient conception of reason upon which Bréhier’s critique entirely relies.
There are three possible relations between a thinker’s philosophy and Christianity in Brunschvicg’s view. If one is primarily a philosopher and secondarily a Christian, it is not really Christian philosophy, just philosophy. Likewise if one is primarily a Christian and secondarily a philosopher, it is not really Christian philosophy. Pascal provides an example of this, where “his Christianity has truly taken possession of the entire man… by uncovering for him a way of philosophizing that is not that of philosophers” (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., 76). There is a third possibility
where we would have to recognize that there is something it would be appropriate to call, without equivocation and without compromise, a Christian philosophy. This is the case where a metaphysician, reflecting in a manner deep and “naive” at the same time, would arrive at that conviction that philosophy ends up only posing problems, entangling itself in difficulties. The clearer a consciousness it will have of these problems, the deeper it will sound the abyss into which these difficulties throw philosophy, the more it will be persuaded that only Christianity’s own solutions will satisfy philosophical problems. (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., 76).
Brunschvicg identifies this possibility with Malebranche (arguably, Blondel would also fit this description), and concedes to him
the privilege and the honor of being the representative, naturally not the sole representative, but the typical and essential representative of a Christian philosophy (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., 76).
Certain neo-Scholastic philosophers and theologians (in particular those representing the Louvain school), while regarding Thomism as the truest and most adequate philosophy available, argued against the possibility or desirability of an explicitly Christian philosophy. Several concerns marked their position, not least of which was maintaining strict distinction between the disciplines of philosophy and theology, whose formulation in their eyes was a central accomplishment of Thomas Aquinas’ thought. Philosophy was to be, indeed could only be, an activity deriving from and employing only purely natural reason, evidence and principles, distinct from theology in which Christian revelation and faith play a role. Neo-Scholastics worried over any implication that human reason might not be essentially the same in the non-believer as in the believer, especially since this would seem to render discussion and comparison with non-Christian philosophies problematic. Their rallying point was the view that Thomism was a genuine philosophy precisely because it was a purely rational philosophy, independently arriving at coincidence with the truths of Christian faith and doctrine.
Pierre Mandonnet adopted the most extreme position, arguing at the 1933 Société Thomiste meeting for a historical interpretation reminiscent of Bréhier’s:
Certainly Christianity has transformed the world, but it has not transformed philosophy….Certainly Christianity has been a considerable factor of progress in humanity, but not progress of a philosophical order. Progress in the philosophical order does not take place by Scripture but by reason….Progress in philosophy therefore does not take place by the paths of religion. Even if there had been neither Revelation nor Incarnation, there would have been development of science and of thought. (La philosophie chrétienne: Juvisy, 11 Septembre 1933, p. 67-8)
He granted that one might speak of Christian philosophy as “a Christian philosophical product,” i.e., the product of the philosophical activity of philosophers who happen to be Christian.
But, this will be a purely personal matter. They have their reasons when they philosophize; they have their reasons for being Christian. The unity is in the subject, who finds himself being a believer and a philosopher; it is not in the work that they produce. (p. 63)
At any rate, Mandonnet avers, the purported Christian philosopher will not be engaging in philosophy, but rather a theology, which can neither be unified with philosophy, nor be made comprehensible to non-believers.
Léon Noël’s position, articulated through recourse both to Aquinas’ thought and to Husserlian phenomenology, demonstrates more flexibility than Mandonnet’s, and distinguishes between two points of view: that of the systematic philosopher, and that of the genesis of a philosophical system. From the former, in its exposition, a philosophy must be entirely rational, free from faith, so that it “rest[s] only on evidence” and remains “purely philosophical, communicable to any other mind, even if it be an unbelieving one, and able to be discussed on the common ground of certainties which all grant.” (“La notion de philosophie chrétienne”, p. 340). From the latter, Christianity can orient or aid the process of study, the development of a philosophical position or doctrine, and does so in and for the individual philosopher:
Christian doctrines do not enter as such into the objective exposition of a philosophy, or then that philosophy would cease to be a philosophy. They cannot serve as such for the basis of a reasoning. But their presence in the mind of the believer can orient the research with a new meaning. (“La notion”, p. 339-40)
In this limited sense, regarding a philosophy whose historical development took place through the influence of Christianity, Noël grants, we can speak of a Christian philosophy, but this is a less rigorous way of speaking and thinking. He maintains that the Christian philosopher who has been aided by Christianity in his or her philosophical research must then strive to remove any dependence on Christian faith or doctrine in their philosophical system, so that it is purely rational, as accessible to the non-believer as it is to his religious counterpart. A “transcendent aspect” will remain in Christian faith, life, and experience, and adequate study of this will require “subordinating one’s judgment to faith,” but this will then cross over the boundary from philosophy into theology. All the philosopher can do, as a philosopher, is note this aspect’s “irreducibility to rational explanation” (“La notion de philosophie chrétienne”, p. 342).
Fernand Van Steenberghen makes points analogous to those made by Noël and Mandonnet (though mildly criticizing the latter), agreeing with them in regarding the term “Christian philosophy” as either the product of, or liable to produce, misunderstandings.
There are Christian philosophers, because some Christians can give themselves over to philosophical research, and because their Christianity disposes them to give themselves over with perspicuity, with prudence, with serenity; it helps them with working out a true philosophy. To the degree that it is true, a philosophy is necessarily compatible with Christianity, open to Christianity, utilizable by Christianity and by theology; its content will be able to partially coincide with that of revelation. But a philosophy will never be “Christian” in the formal and rigorous sense. One can, doubtless, speak of Christian philosophers in a purely material sense, to designate philosophies that have been worked out by Christian thinkers. But since the facts demonstrate the latent danger of this usage, it would be better to avoid using an expression that, far from illuminating anything, is a source of confusions and equivocations. (“La IIe journée d’études de la Société Thomiste et la notion de ‘philosophie chrétienne’”, p. 554)
Van Steenberghen made several additional points. Agreeing with Blondel and Sertillanges in that philosophy’s task is to extend itself as far as it can to all of reality, he proposed the Philosophy of Religion in place of Christian philosophy, which should include the sub-discipline ‘Philosophy of Christianity’. He criticized Thomist proponents of Christian philosophy, in particular Gilson, Maritain and Sertillanges, for having “mix[ed] up things important to carefully distinguish” philosophy and theology, and “the personal attitude of the Christian philosopher and the method of philosophy…the psychological coming-to-being of a science and its logical coming-to-being.” (“La IIe journée”, p. 550-1)
Etienne Gilson argued for Christian philosophy’s legitimacy and observable historical reality, and explored particular achievements of Medieval Christian philosophies in depth. Contrary to Henri Gouhier’s critique in his work that “the dossier of the notion of ‘Christian philosophy’ does not appear to present any change, any evolution” (p. 66), Gilson continued to revise his assessment of significant authors during the Debates. Early on in the Debates, bringing up “Saint Augustine’s credo ut intelligam and Saint Anselm’s fides quaerens intellectum,” he considered “these two formulas…the true definition of Christian philosophy” (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 48). He would later revise his assessment, narrowing the scope of Christian philosophy primarily to Thomism, construing Augustinianism as reflecting a primacy of faith over reason (Reason and Revelation in the Middle Ages, p. 17-33) and explicitly rejecting the Anselmian fides quaerens intellectum, now seeing “in that formula, an exclusive ambition and limitation, which forbids us from seeing in the definition of the attitude of a Christian philosopher” (“Sens et nature de l’argument de Saint Anselme,” p. 49, note 2).
Gilson grabbed Bréhier’s dilemma by its horns: “I will say that in my view the Christian philosophy he thinks is not interesting at all but does exist, does not exist, whereas the one he deems that it would be interesting but does not exist, does exist” (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 52). Historical examination indicates that the Catholic magisterium (in Christianity and Philosophy, Gilson extends his purview to Reformed and Lutheran positions) addresses philosophy in a more complex manner than Bréhier’s simplistic interpretation, so that there never has been a philosophy simply dictated by a religious magisterium. Whether Christianity has in fact made any positive contributions to philosophy remains an open question requiring thorough historical study, which directed Gilson to the existence of Christian philosophies, particularly in the Middle Ages. “What I seek in the notion of Christian philosophy is therefore a conceptual translation of what I believe to be a historically observable object: philosophy in its Christian state” (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 73).
He also criticized Neo-Scholastic opponents of Christian philosophy for unnecessarily “adopt[ing] the position of their opponents,” but also for assuming that
[i]n Thomism alone we have a system in which philosophic conclusions are deduced from purely rational premises….Philosophy, doubtless, is subordinate to theology, but, as philosophy, it depends on nothing but its own proper method; based on human reason, owing all of its truth to the self-evidence of its principles and the accuracy of its deduction, it reaches an accord spontaneously and without having to deviate in any way from its own proper path. (The Spirit of Medieval Philosophy, p. 6)
Any relation between philosophy and Christianity, however, becomes merely fortuitous and extrinsic. “Once reason, as regards its exercise, has been divorced from faith, all intrinsic relation between Christianity and philosophy becomes a contradiction” (The Spirit of Medieval Philosophy, p. 7). What the Neo-Thomists had forgotten was that “faith and reason are rooted in the unity of the concrete subject.” (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 45-6)
Gilson also criticized another position, “philosophy of the concrete,” rightly identifying this with Bergson and wrongly with Blondel. In his view (and Maritain’s, who would make similar criticisms) these philosophies bore strong affinities with Augustinian positions and were favorable to Christian philosophy, but as they were hostile to conceptual articulation, they were liable to stray into theology or apologetics. He also argues against a plausibly Blondelian position: “[a] philosophy open to the supernatural would certainly be compatible with Christianity, but it would not necessarily be a Christian philosophy.”
In order to defend the notion of Christian philosophy, simply noting the existence of philosophies in which Christianity had made some contribution was not sufficient, and Gilson was particularly concerned to clarify Christian philosophy’s nature, providing several definitions of Christian philosophy:
I call Christian every philosophy which, although keeping the two orders formally distinct, nevertheless considers the Christian revelation as an indispensable auxiliary to reason….[T]he concept does not correspond to any simple essence susceptible of abstract definition; but corresponds much rather to a concrete historical reality as something calling for description….[It] includes in its extension all those philosophical systems which were in fact what they were because a Christian religion existed and because they were ready to submit to its influence. (The Spirit of Medieval Philosophy, p. 37)
If philosophical systems exist, purely rational in their principles and in their methods, whose existence is not explained without the existence of the Christian religion, the philosophies that they define merit the name of Christian philosophies. This notion does not correspond to a concept of a pure essence, that of the philosopher or that of the Christian, but to the possibility of a complex historical reality: that of a revelation generative of reason. (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 39)
If there have been philosophies, i.e., systems of rational truths, whose existence cannot be explained historically without taking account of Christianity’s existence, these philosophies should bear the name of Christian philosophies…. For the relation between both concepts to be intrinsic, it is not enough that a philosophy be compatible with Christianity; it is necessary that Christianity have played an active role in the very establishment of that philosophy. (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 46)
He also characterized the range, objects, and condition of Christian philosophy:
[T]he content of Christian philosophy is that body of rational truths discovered, explored, or simply safeguarded, thanks to the help that reason receives from revelation (The Spirit of Medieval Philosophy, p. 35)
[T]he essential domain of Christian philosophy corresponds exactly to the limits of natural theology, but accidentally, it exerts an influence on almost the whole of philosophy (Christianity and Philosophy, p. 131)
[E]very Christian philosophy will be traversed, impregnated, nourished by Christianity as by a blood that circulates in it, or rather, like a life that animates it. One will never be able to say that here the philosophical ends and the Christian begins; it will be integrally Christian and integrally philosophical or it will not be. (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 46)
Gilson’s position made three additional contributions to understanding the nature and the problem of Christian philosophy. First, he repeatedly stresses that an aspect central to the problem of Christian philosophy was the problem of the relations between faith and reason. Second, he specifies that in the use of their reason and in the course of their philosophical activity, past Christian philosophers drew upon resources offered them by the Christian faith and revelation. One way this took place was by ideas, e.g. those of creation ex nihilo, of God as being, of personality, derived originally from the non-rational religious source, then appropriated by Christian (as well as Jewish and Muslim) thinkers, who fruitfully brought them into their philosophical activity and systems. Christian philosophy represents the philosophical activity of reason working on, and bringing rationality to data derived originally from non-rational religious sources.
[O]nce this philosopher is also a Christian, his reason’s exercise will be that of a Christian’s reason, i.e., not a reason of a different type than that of non-Christian philosophers, but a reason that labors under different conditions….[I]t is true that his reason is that of a subject in which there is something non-rational, his religious faith….I ask especially whether the philosophical life is not precisely a constant effort to bring what is irrational in us to the state of rationality….What is peculiar to the Christian is being convinced of the rational fertility of his faith and being sure that this fertility is inexhaustible. (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 47)
Third, he redirects focus from abstract ways of framing this problem towards concrete philosophizing human subjects, in whom faith and reason coexist, and who both engage in and are formed by philosophy and Christianity. Gilson guardedly accepts the Augustinian position:
He knows that faith is faith and reason is reason, but he adds that a man’s faith and a man’s reason are not two uncoordinated accidents of the same substance. In his view, the real is the man himself, a profound unity, not dissociable into juxtaposed elements as fragments of a mosaic would be, a unity in which nature and grace, reason and faith, cannot function each one on its own, like in a mechanism whose pieces would have been purchased at the store as separate parts. If therefore a Christian man philosophizes, and if he expresses himself truly in his philosophy, this cannot fail to be a Christian philosophy. (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 45)
Gilson argues that this correctly reflects “the real unity of the elements of the concrete in the subject where they are realized….If there were a faith and a reason in us, whose being was radically distinct from that of a thinking substance to which they belong, we could not say of any of us that he was a man” (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 45-6).
Maritain regarded his own position as a “doctrinal’ (that is, strictly philosophical) complement to Gilson’s historically derived position. Like Gilson, he criticized rationalist and neo-Scholastic opponents of Christian philosophy, but also articulated fuller criticisms of Blondel (An Essay on Christian Philosophy, p. 7-11, 55-61, Science and Wisdom, p. 82-86). He agreed with Blondel on the mistake of Christian thinkers calling for and generating a “separated philosophy,” which he regarded as “completely contrary to the spirit of Thomism” (Essay, p. 8), but saw three main flaws in Blondel’s position. First, he rightly notes the errors in Blondel’s own critique based on reductive misinterpretations of Gilson’s position. Second, he charges Blondel with a lack of clarity, blurring lines between philosophy and theology, thus
transfer[ring] to the heart of a philosophy what holds true of an apologetics…apologetics, by its own nature and essence presupposes the solicitations of grace and the operations of the heart and will on the part of the one who hears, and the light of faith already possessed on the part of the one who speaks; philosophy by its nature and essence exacts…only reason in the one who searches. (Essay, p. 9)
Third, admitting the “insufficiency of philosophy,” Maritain rejects Blondel’s call for and project of “philosophy of insufficiency,” making charges similar to Gilson’s, that by critiquing conceptualism, Blondel rejects concepts and objective knowledge.
Maritain’s most important contribution was to frame the useful distinction between the nature and the state of philosophy:
[W]e must distinguish between the nature of philosophy, or what it is in itself, and the state in which it exists in real fact, historically, in the human subject, and which pertains to its concrete conditions of existence and exercise. (Essay, p. 11-2)
In its nature or essence, philosophy is “intrinsically a natural and rational form of knowledge” (Essay, p. 14), entirely independent from faith. As a form of knowledge, philosophy is specified by its object(s): “within the realm of the real, created and uncreated…a whole class of objects which are of their nature attainable through the natural faculties of the human mind” (Essay, p. 14). In its nature, however, philosophy is
a pure abstract essence. It is all too easy a matter to endow such an abstraction with reality, to clothe it as such with a concrete existence. An ideological monster results; such, in my opinion, occurred in the case both of the rationalists and the neo-Thomists whom Mr. Gilson has called to task (Essay, p. 14).
In its essence, philosophy is neither Christian nor non-Christian. Turning to concrete states in which philosophy actually exists, it becomes possible for a philosopher to be a Christian and for his or her philosophy to be a Christian philosophy. On this basis, Maritain supplies several characterizations of Christian philosophy. From the start, he frames it as not “a simple essence, but a complex: an essence grasped in a certain state” (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 67), later adding: “under conditions of performance, of existence and of life, for or against which one is in fact obliged to make a choice” (Science and Wisdom, p. 81). He clarifies:
Christian philosophy is not a determinate body of truths, although, in my opinion, the doctrine of St. Thomas exemplifies its amplest and purest form. Christian philosophy is philosophy itself in so far as it is situated in those utterly distinctive conditions of existence and exercise into which Christianity has ushered the thinking subject, and as a result of which philosophy perceives certain objects and validly demonstrates certain propositions, which in any other circumstances would to a greater or lesser extent elude it. (Essay, p. 30)
Maritain distinguishes two main ways in which Christianity aids the activity of philosophy in concrete states: objective contributions and subjective reinforcements. Christianity makes objective contributions by supplying philosophy with data and ideas. Some of these “belong within the field of philosophy, but….philosophers failed to recognize [them] explicitly” (Essay, p. 18), e.g. the ideas of creation or of sin. Others are “objective data which philosophy knew well but which it approached with much hesitancy and which…was corroborated by revelation” (Essay, p. 21). Even in cases of mysteries of the Christian faith, philosophy develops further, as an instrument of theology it “learn[s] many things whole being thus led along paths which are not its own” (Essay, p. 22). It also has its field of inquiry, its possible objects of study, expanded, as happened with “speculation on the dogmas of the Trinity and the Incarnation,” productive of “an awareness of the metaphysical problem of the person” (Essay, p. 23).
Subjective reinforcements are the ways in which Christian faith and practice concretely aid the philosophical activity of the human person by putting them in a better condition to do philosophy. Though strictly speaking these are numberless, Maritain identifies several subjective reinforcements bearing on philosophy as a habitus, which attains a better use when set in “synergy and vital solidarity, this dynamic continuity of habitus” with theology (Essay, p. 27). Divine grace also removes or ameliorates impediments to philosophizing well, so that “the more the philosopher remains faithful to grace, the more easily will he free himself of manifold futilities and opacities.” (Essay, p. 28)
Blondel, universally acknowledged by French commentators as the third main proponent of Christian philosophy, developed a complex position intimately connected with previous and later works, and resisting brief summarization. Accordingly, only four main components of his position are addressed here: his critique of rationalists and Neo-Scholastics, his critique of Gilson, the philosophy of insufficiency, history and the problem of the supernatural, and the stages of Christian philosophy.
Since his early works (cf. the Letter on Apologetics), Blondel had criticized the “separated philosophy” of certain Neo-Scholastics for ignoring the problematic imposed on philosophy by the “religious problem” (a meta-philosophical requirement for philosophy to fully take Christianity into account without thereby rationalizing it). By their care to exclude anything explicitly Christian from their philosophizing while still desiring to generate philosophy substantially in agreement with Christian theology, Neo-Scholastic philosophy lapsed into a philosophically sterile “concordism” in which philosophy and Christianity are only extrinsically related to each other, but philosophical doctrines are nevertheless judged correct or incorrect by their agreement with dogma. Blondel also took on Bréhier directly, charging him with relying on his own “dogmatism imposing itself by authority” (“Y-a-t’il”, p. 601), characterized by a reductive and rigid conception of reason and straw-man caricatures of Christian thinkers Bréhier claimed to rationally critique. In this way, “dogmatic rationalism becomes irrational and seems to mutilate history just as much as philosophical speculation itself” (“Y-a-t’il”, p. 600). In particular, Bréhier’s two criticisms of Blondel turn out not only to be untrue, but also mutually inconsistent.
At much greater length and with greater severity, Blondel consistently criticized Gilson’s (and by implication, Maritain’s) position. Though incorrect (and uncharitable) in ascribing these to Gilson, Blondel’s identification and criticism of several errors in handling the problem of Christian philosophy nevertheless retain their philosophical merit. He diagnosed two main (meta-)philosophical mistakes: conceptualism and historicism. Conceptualism maintains
philosophical doctrines, as different as they may be, ultimately aim at sealing themselves off in closed, sufficient, and exclusive systems; these systems organize themselves with and terminate in concepts, and all that does not succeed in being raised into concepts repulses philosophy. (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p.87-8)
This reduces philosophy to an abstract, static construction of concepts, hampering philosophy from engaging its full range of objects, obscuring that
this is precisely what is in question: can it not be philosophical, is it not “conceivable”, is it not even normal, that philosophy opens ulterior perspectives…orients and stimulates spiritual life’s dynamism by posing inevitable problems whose complete solution it does not provide, even though it serves to not allow them to be misunderstood nor falsely resolved? (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 88)
What Blondel terms “historicism” reflects attempts to resolve the problem of Christian philosophy through direct appeal to the discipline of history (or history of philosophy). This introduces a dilemma, however, “doubly compromising both to Philosophy and to the Christian Revelation”:
[I]f history as an intermediary, provides data taken from Christianity in a mixture of public facts or of private experiences to the laboratory of philosophical reflection, it is by forcibly stripping the data of their supernatural originality; it accepts them, puts them into its mill, experiments on them in its own natural and rational activity. (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 89)
Inversely, by wanting to integrate dogmas, ideas, ascetic practices, mystical experiences coming to it from outside within itself, philosophy that would not have preliminarily opened in itself this empty space of which we spoke, by its very care not to alter the supernatural character of Christian data, introduces a foreign body into its flesh, a packet of incurably wounding spines. (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 89)
His reference to the “empty space” leads into Blondel’s positive conception of Christian philosophy, which will be in part “an open philosophy…recogniz[ing] its limits by being ready to accept ulterior data” (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 90). This will be a philosophy of insufficiency, i.e., philosophy that thematizes philosophy’s own insufficiency to fully comprehend, rationally articulate, and systematize its own objects, the ranges of realities to which it extends, and the human subject engaged in philosophizing. It will also acknowledge that philosophy’s own intrinsic requirement of autonomy culminates in philosophy freely allowing itself to be further determined, guided and shaped by something transcending philosophy. Against conceptualism, Blondel proposes another possibility:
must philosophy end up, whatever the level of its development may be, in recognizing how it is normally incomplete, how it opens in itself and before itself an empty space prepared not only for its own ulterior discoveries and on its own ground, but for illuminations and contributions whose real origin it is not and cannot become?…[I]t is this second thesis, philosophically definable and supportable, i.e. without proceeding from a revelation, that is alone in spontaneous and deep agreement with Christianity. Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 90)
He expands the metaphor, employing similar terminology, e.g.:
[a] gap coming from above (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 91)
[the] interior open space or the silence of the soul (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 91)
infinitesimal and real fissures, ‘holes’ that require being filled and which admit consequently the presence or even the need of another reality, of a heterogeneous and complementary datum. (“Le problème de la philosophie catholique,” p. 43)
These spaces occur throughout the fabric of philosophical thought. There are “relations of emptiness and fullness where two incommensurable orders unfold themselves,” (Le problème de la philosophie chrétienne, p. 147) within the same concrete human subject. These spaces are not simply philosophical voids:
[W]e do not remain in the presence of a black hole, of an ocean for which neither ship nor sail would seem possible. The empty space that we spoke of earlier is not a chimerical fiction, projection of restlessness, sickness of the soul. It has…contours to discern, a reason for being to meditate on and to render rationally admissible, an attractive and imperious character. (Bul. Soc fr. Phil., p. 90)
Blondel’s attitude towards history and Christian philosophy is considerably more complex than a simple rejection. From within the perspective generated and secured by a philosophy of insufficiency, appeal to history and reinterpretation of historical examples of Christian philosophy becomes legitimate. History in fact displays a “chronic condition” in which philosophy and Christianity generate “incessant antagonisms or the renewed efforts of compenetration…throughout the ages.” This condition “possesses an intelligible signification”, and it is “philosophy’s role to seek out its causes and to discern its enduring reasons.” (“Le problème,” p. 14) In modernity and through modern thought, the most fundamental aspect of the problem of Christian philosophy come to light. Previous, ultimately unsuccessful, attempts at Christian philosophies have made “the very conception of philosophy evolve….preparing discernment of what remains incommensurable between the rational order and the supernatural order.” (“Le problème,” p. 17) in the end
bringing the always looming crisis between rational autonomy and Christian demands to a vital point that historical, exegetical, and apologetic considerations do not reach, insofar as they appear in isolation without the preliminary question being raised, the question whose precise meaning, normal character, and essential scope we have just tried to exhibit. (“Le problème ,” p. 18-9)
This central question is the “problem of the supernatural” and Christian philosophy has to self-consciously grapple with, conceptualize, and bring about a condition involving:
[n]either dependence nor independence nor simple juxtaposition of the rational order and the Christian order; but a type of heterogeneity in compenetration and of symbiosis in the very incommensurability. (Le problème, p. 145)
In Le problème de la philosophie chrétienne (cf. also “Pour une philosophie intégrale”, p. 57-62), Blondel explicitly construed Christian philosophy as a three-stage set of projects correlated to several states or conditions of human being. Among these is a “a state of nature that actually could subsist, but which also actually has never existed for humanity in the historical and concrete order,” (Le problème, p. 25) i.e. actually an abstraction. The others include those of “original justice,” and of “decay,” the “transnatural state,” and the state in which “a person is introduced into the supernatural order.” (Le problème, p. 25-27)
Each state is a possible object of study for philosophy. Corresponding to the state of nature, “essential philosophy” (that is, philosophy of insufficiency) systematically examines necessary and possible conditions and structures of human thought and action. At this stage, philosophy becomes critically aware of its own insufficiencies, and human reason is brought to recognition, opening, and orientation towards the “empty space” but not yet to determinately entering it.
The second stage, in which philosophy enters the opened space seeking the supernatural, involves a second philosophical project: “a sort of mixed philosophy, a philosophy of the possible relations…between essential possibilities or necessities and realizable contingents.” (Le problème, p. 167). In the third philosophical project, philosophy engages what Christianity teaches to be humanity’s and all other created being’s real condition, becoming reoriented and expanded in the process. At this stage, it becomes possible “to study the repercussions in natural man of the different states – transnatural, supernatural or rebel – that awaken in consciousness and the will data or reactions other than those of a pure state of nature.” (Le problème, p. 171)
In his position on Christian philosophy, Marcel harmonized the positions, believed incompatible by their authors, of Gilson and Maritain on one side, and Blondel on the other. He also made enough original contributions of his own to justify interpreting his position as a fourth main position for Christian philosophy. One of these contributions was raising an additional problem for rationalist or neo-Scholastic opponents of Christian philosophy:
If it was admitted that Christianity has had no positive influence on philosophical development, this would entail saying that it has never actually been able to be thought – for there is no thought worthy of that name that does not contribute to transforming all the other thoughts….To say that Christianity has never been thought is to let it be understood that it is not thinkable. (“A propos de L’esprit de la Philosophie médiévale par M. E. Gilson,” p. 309)
While praising Gilson’s The Spirit of Medieval Philosophy, Marcel argued, in terms similar to Blondel’s, that
[t]he contribution here is a certain datum – a revealed datum – whose signification, whose value is absolutely transcendent to any experience susceptible of being constituted on purely human bases. There is the paradox, the scandal, if you like. I would be disposed for my part, to think that there is Christian philosophy only there where this paradox, this scandal is not only admitted or even accepted, but embraced with a passionate and unrestricted gratitude. From the moment on when, to the contrary, philosophy seeks by some procedure to attenuate this scandal, to mask the paradox, to reabsorb the revealed datum in a dialectic of pure reason or mind, to this precise degree it ceases to be a Christian philosophy (“A propos”, p. 311-2)
The paradox or scandal Marcel regards as most central to Christian philosophy is the Incarnation, which bears important implications for philosophy and reason itself.
Perhaps it would not be abusive to claim that the essence of such a philosophy is a meditation on that datum’s implications and consequences of every order, not only unpredictable but contrary to reason’s superficial demands from the very start wrongly posing themselves as inviolable. But, the essential function of metaphysical reflection will consist in critiquing these demands in the name of higher demands, and consequently in the name of a superior reason that faith in the Incarnation puts precisely in the condition of becoming fully conscious of itself. (“A propos”, p. 312)
He adds that “the central light residing in the Incarnation radiates in reality through all of the regions of metaphysics” (“A propos”, p. 312), generating the historical examples of Christian philosophy Gilson studied and identified in his works. Christian philosophy, as Marcel envisioned it, has the task not only of noting cases where Christianity has exerted a generative effect on philosophy, but also of investigating how this is possible. This, in turn, requires that “our reason – a created reason ordered to the intelligence of created nature – must, in deepening itself, recognize what in it exceeds the domain of adequacy to itself” (“A propos”, p. 1305).
Although numerous philosophers have accepted the verdict of fundamental incompatibility between the Gilson-Maritain and Blondel positions, many participants in and commentators on the debates early on saw not only compatibility but even complementarity between their positions, among them Antonin Sertillanges, Bruno De Solages, Aimé Forest, and Henri De Lubac (all of whom were Thomists). Asserting this involved not only arguing compatibility between the positions on Christian philosophy, but also interpreting Thomism as being compatible with the requirements of Blondel’s non-Thomist philosophy.
De Solages likens Gilson’s, Maritain’s and Blondel’s positions on Christian philosophy to three different paths climbing the same mountain:
None of the three lead to the same peak, for our mountain has three peaks, but it seems to me that the view that one has from each of them marvelously completes the view that one has from the others, and that all three allow one to make for oneself a sufficiently complex and exact idea of this complex reality. (“Le problème de la philosophie chrétienne,” p. 232)
De Lubac, drawing from De Solages and Sertillanges, provides a classic account reconciling Blondel with Gilson and Maritain, as well as noting certain differences between the latter two.
If we believe Maritain and Gilson, their two positions come together, one in treating the problem from the historical point of view and the other. In practice, however, Gilson, who is the better historian, admits a greater influence than Maritain concedes…. [O]nly the third thesis, that of Blondel, establishes a truly intrinsic relationship between rational speculation and supernatural revelation, without, for all that, opening to philosophy the mysterious content of this revelation. (“Retrieving the Tradition: On Christian Philosophy”, p.482-3)
He distinguishes several different distinguishable types of Christian philosophy:
[T]here is another sense in which one can and must speak of a Christian philosophy…a sense no longer historical but metaphysical. It is, then, no longer a matter of a philosophy, or of philosophies, which, in fact, find themselves to be Christian because they have received a Christian contribution…Instead, it is a question of the philosophy, which, to be truly and integrally philosophy, must, in a certain way, be Christian. (“Retrieving the Tradition”, p 486)
The relationship between these types is not one of opposition or exclusion, but one going beyond even compatibility or complementarity to mutual requirement. The Gilson-Maritain position needs to be completed and self-critically secured by the Blondelian one: “[T]o the double recognition of the subjective comforts and the objective contributions which philosophy owes to Christianity, it is indispensable to add the elaboration of a philosophy of insufficiency.” Additionally, “posing the problem of the relationship between supernatural mystery and the reason it fertilizes, leads us to look for another more comprehensive meaning of Christian philosophy.” (“Retrieving the Tradition”, p. 494-5) Blondel’s thought is possible, however, only on the unacknowledged basis of the type of Christian philosophy Gilson and Maritain focused on:
[I]f we speak concretely, psychologically, and historically, we will say that this absolute Christian philosophy presupposes the first kind of Christian philosophy, which is completely contingent. We add that it presupposes this contingent Christian philosophy as already established and developed for enough time to have profoundly penetrated the understanding and to have laid bare the secret law. (“Retrieving the Tradition,” p. 488)
This selective bibliography provides reference to only a portion of the literature either from or about the debates about Christian philosophy, positions developed, and issues involved. For more extensive bibliographies, cf. Bernard Badoux, O.F.M., “Quaestio de philosophia christiana,” Antonianum, vol. 11, p. 487-552; and Luigi Bogliolo. La Filosophia Cristiana: Il problema, la storia, la struttura (Rome: Libreria Editrice Vaticana. 1986). All translations from the French, unless otherwise noted in the bibliography, are the author’s.
This list includes two types of literature: 1) books, articles, and conference reports directly part of the debates; 2) books, articles, and conference reports subsequent to the debates in which the positions of these participants are further developed. Many other documents not listed here, of lesser importance or centrality, also form part of the debates.
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Last updated: May 6, 2009 | Originally published: