Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Cicero: Academic Skepticism

cicero-02Cicero (106 to 43 B.C.E.) adopted the philosophical view of the Academic skeptics as a young man sometime in the 80′s. In 89/8, Philo of Larissa, the head of Plato’s Academy, fled from Athens to Rome for political reasons. While at Rome, Cicero attended Philo’s public lectures and began to study philosophy with him. Cicero also studied with the most prominent representatives of other Hellenistic philosophical schools: Posidonius (a Stoic), Zeno of Citium and Phaedrus (Epicureans), and Cratippus (a Peripatetic). Although the Academy probably ceased to exist as an institution after Philo’s death in 84, Cicero continued to champion its methodology in his philosophical dialogues.

The Academic position appealed to Cicero for a variety of reasons (Section 1). The Academics argued on both sides of every issue in order to undermine the dogmatic confidence of their interlocutors. Cicero’s teacher Philo also applied this method in order to determine which position enjoyed the most rational support. Given his rhetorical and forensic skills, Cicero likely found this method attractive. It was also ideal for his project of inducing the ruling class Romans to take up the practice of philosophy. Rather than present his personal views, Cicero laid out in dialogue form the strongest arguments he could mine from other philosophical texts. The idea was to encourage the reader to come to his own conclusion, but even more importantly, to adopt the Academic method of inquiry. Perhaps the most attractive feature of Academic philosophy for Cicero was the intellectual freedom guaranteed by the method. The Academic is bound to no particular doctrine as an Academic. He is only bound to accept the verdict of his best rational assessment of the arguments pro and con.

Cicero asserts that the reasons for his Academic allegiance are set out fully in his Academica (De Natura Deorum 1.11). Although these Academic books are fragmentary, they nonetheless provide a detailed account of the dispute between the Academics and Stoics on the possibility of knowledge (Sections 2 and 3) along with Philo’s explanation for how we can manage quite well without knowledge (Section 4).

Table of Contents

  1. The Skeptical Academy and its Appeal to Cicero
  2. Arguments For and Against Stoic Epistemology in the Academica
  3. Indirect Arguments in Support of Stoic Epistemology in the Academica
  4. The Positive Fallibilism of the Philonian Academy
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Latin Texts and Translations
    2. Select Bibliography of Secondary Literature

1. The Skeptical Academy and its Appeal to Cicero

There were some important variations among the Academics during the Academy’s skeptical period (c. 268/7 B.C.E to 1st century B.C.E.), but there is also a unifying feature. They all focused squarely, if not exclusively, on refutation. Inspired by Socrates (as he appears in some of Plato’s dialogues), they sought to combat the overly confident attitude of the dogmatists. Since the Stoics were the most influential dogmatists of the time, the skeptical Academics devoted much of their energy to combating them in particular. (Dogmatism in the Hellenistic period is simply a matter of positively affirming that one knows the truth of some systematically related philosophical propositions—it need not have the pejorative connotation currently associated with it.)

In order to refute their opponents, the Academics argued dialectically. Rather than assert a position themselves, they would reveal to the interlocutor that his beliefs are mutually inconsistent and thus that he is not able to justify his claim to knowledge. For example, suppose I claim to know that justice is whatever the strong say it is. Then, in response to a skeptic’s questioning, I am led on the basis of my own premises to conclude that justice is not whatever the strong say it is. It follows that I did not really know what I claimed to know. The operative assumption is that if I had known what justice is, I would have been able to show why my belief is true. If I contradict myself or run out of plausible reasons, then I do not know what justice is after all—even if my belief turns out to be true, I do not know why it is true.

Later Academics also began arguing on both sides of every issue, pro and con. Some apparently sought to show that nothing whatsoever could be known about the issue in question. To accomplish this end, they showed others that there are equally strong arguments for and against, and thus no compelling reason to accept any position. Others employed the same method in order to discover which side of an issue could be most plausibly defended. But all of the Academics agreed that the Stoics had failed to adequately defend their epistemology; that is, they had not shown that knowledge is possible (much more on this below in sections 2 and 3).

Cicero found the later Academic position appealing for a variety of reasons. The method of arguing pro and con was a natural fit with his tremendous oratorical and forensic skill. As a lawyer and orator he was pleased by the Academy’s insistence on teaching rhetoric along with philosophy on the grounds that the two disciplines were mutually supportive. He also found the position ideally suited to his philosophical project of inspiring the Roman ruling class to take up the practice of philosophy. In his dialogues he employs the Academic method with the intention of encouraging his readers to think for themselves rather than to rely on authority.

He was perhaps most attracted by the Academics’ intellectual freedom. In his earliest statement of Academic allegiance, Cicero remarks that he will gladly change his opinion if someone points out his error. For it is not shameful to have insufficiently understood something. It is shameful, however, to have persevered foolishly and for a long time with insufficient understanding. The reason for this is that insufficient understanding is due to the common weakness of mankind. It is, to some extent inevitable, or at least excusable. Foolish perseverance, however, can be avoided, and hence is shameful and blameworthy. (De Inventione 2.9) Cicero describes such perseverance as the stubborn adherence to one’s position because he has come to feel some affection for it. The Academic, by contrast, is supposed to have no extra-rational motives in defending his view or in persevering, when or if he does.

Part of the rationale for this way of proceeding is that we cannot fully appreciate the relative strengths and weaknesses of the available philosophical positions unless we have thoroughly explored what can be said for and against them. To align oneself to a philosophical position prior to this is premature. As we start out we lack the knowledge or wisdom we seek, and thus we are not in a position to adequately judge which system or which philosopher to follow. Once one undertakes the Academic project, he or she may find, as Cicero did, that one lifetime is not sufficient for completing the project and taking a final stand.

This freedom to change one’s position in accordance with a new assessment of the arguments may appear to dispense with any concern for consistency. Suppose for example that I no longer believe that the arguments in favor of going to war with Carthage are compelling. While I previously believed Rome was justified in going to war, I now believe the opposite. As an Academic I am free to change my position as often as I like. I am not bound by any doctrinal constraints due to my philosophical allegiance. And I am not bound by what I formerly believed. Remaining consistent with my former beliefs is never as important as accepting the verdict of my current assessment of the arguments.

Academic freedom is not an end in itself however; it is a means to arriving at the most rationally defensible position. This is why Cicero characterizes the Academic’s method as aimed at drawing out and articulating that view which can be maintained most consistently (Academica 2.9) and as aimed at revealing what is true or at least the closest approximation to the truth (Academica 2.7, 2.65-66, De Officiis 2.8, Tusculan Disputations 1.8). The consistency sought is an accord with the rational evidence and not with one’s previous beliefs.

Cicero frequently singles out this freedom as the most definitive and attractive feature of the Academics’ philosophical practice (for example, De Legibus 1.36, Academica 2.134, Tusculan Disputations 4.83, 5.33, 5.82, De Officiis 2.7, 3.20). They alone are free to accept whatever strikes them as most plausible at that moment (see Section 4 below for more on Academic probabilism).

2. Arguments For and Against Stoic Epistemology in the Academica

During his final encyclopedic burst of dialogues (46-44 B.C.), Cicero wrote his epistemological work, the Academica. The original version contained two books named after the principal interlocutor in each, Catulus and Lucullus. The latter of the two is extant, and generally referred to as Ac. 2 or Lucullus (= Luc.). Cicero revised these original two books, dividing them into four, and replaced Lucullus with Varro as principal interlocutor throughout. Only about the first fourth of the revised version is extant. It is generally referred to as Ac. 1.

In these books Cicero presents arguments for and against the Stoic theory of knowledge as well as the Academics’ own positive, fallibilistic alternative. It should be noted that ethics and epistemology are inextricably connected in the Academic books. Cicero remarks on several occasions that what they are investigating is the sage—that is, an ideal of the perfectly wise human being. Ultimately, the question about the possibility of knowledge on the Stoic account, and in Hellenistic philosophy in general, is a question about the possibility of wisdom. The Hellenistic philosophers followed Plato’s Socrates in taking their primary task to be the discovery of the best human life.

In order to meet this challenge, Zeno of Citium, the founder of Stoicism, developed an account of how the knowledge that Socrates sought—that is, the knowledge that guides one in living the best possible human life—could in fact be attained. That it could be attained he established on the grounds that the universe is providentially arranged. From the providential arrangement it follows that human beings must be equipped to satisfy their desire for knowledge, for Nature would not have acted so capriciously as to give us such an important desire without also providing the means to fulfill it.

If one developed his natural abilities in accordance with Nature he would eventually learn to infallibly distinguish what is true from what is false, at least with regard to matters pertaining to happiness. The sage is not omniscient, but he is infallible. His knowledge guarantees that he will always live in accordance with nature, which is identical to being virtuous and happy.

All of the sage’s beliefs are true, and grasped in such a way that no experience and no argument is able to dislodge him from his conviction. This irrefutability depends crucially on the fact that all of the sage’s beliefs are true and firmly grasped as such. If he were to hold even one false belief he might be persuaded to rely on it in abandoning true beliefs. So we can see that the sage’s knowledge is systematic in that each of his true beliefs is supported by the others.

The foundation of this account of knowledge is a type of impression about which we cannot be mistaken. This type of impression provides us with a criterion of truth, that is, a measuring stick one can use to determine what is and what is not the case. If the Academics could succeed in showing that there are no such impressions, they would effectively undermine the possibility of attaining the knowledge built upon them.

Thus, the central issue in Ac. 2 is whether or not an impression can be apprehended or grasped in such a way as to guarantee its truth. Zeno described such an impression as cognitive, or mentally graspable (katalêpton), and defined it as one that

(1) comes from what is the case, that is, some existent state of affairs
(2) accurately conveys all the relevant features of what it comes from, and
(3) cannot be exactly like an impression that comes from what is not the case (Ac. 2.77, cp. Sextus’ account at Adversus Mathematikos [= M] 7.248).

Katalêpsis occurs when one assents to a cognitive impression, thereby firmly grasping its truth. So whenever one assents to a cognitive impression one necessarily forms a true belief.

The pressing question is whether one can learn to distinguish cognitive from non-cognitive impressions. It seems that one can never know whether (1) and (2) have been satisfied except by inspecting the perceptual content of the impression. If so, this opens the way for the Academics’ main objection. (It should be noted that the Stoics did not think all cognitive impressions are perceptual. We may have cognitive impressions of evaluative states of affairs—for example that it is good for us to help our friend. However most of the evidence regarding the possibility of such impressions is limited to perceptual cases, and so the following discussion will be similarly limited.)

The Academics demanded that the Stoics produce an instance of this cognitive grasping that is immune to skeptical counterexamples, that is, immune to scenarios in which a true impression provides the same sensory evidence as its false imitator. Apparently there is a plentiful supply of such counterexamples, and the Academics spent a great deal of effort developing them. (Ac. 2.42) One type illustrates cases of misidentification: for example, identical twins, eggs, statues, or imprints in wax made by the same ring. (Ac. 2.84-87) Another type involves cases of illusion, dreams and madness. (Ac. 2.88-91)

So it seems that any example of an allegedly cognitive impression offered by the Stoics can be countered by the Academics’ doppelganger or a scenario in which some mental defect and not the object is responsible for the perceptual content of the impression. In either case, the Academics challenge the third characteristic above of cognitive impressions. This challenge is evident in Cicero’s report. (Ac. 2.83, cf. 2.40) The Academics agree with the Stoics that some impressions are true and some are false, and that false impressions are never cognitive. They also agree that if there were no differences between two impressions then these impressions must either both be cognitive or both fail to be cognitive, that is, either the perceptual content of both guarantee their truth or fails to guarantee their truth. In other words, if there were no differences between the two impressions it cannot be the case that one is cognitive and the other is not. The crucial premise, and the crux of the debate, is the Academics’ claim, contrary to (3) above, that

(4) for every true impression there may exist a false one that is identical (that is, qualitatively, not numerically).

If we grant (4), then there can be no impression whose perceptual content guarantees its truth; that is, there can be no cognitive impressions. Imagine that you have received an exceedingly clear and distinct impression of an orange. No matter how much you seek to corroborate the truth of this impression, or acquire an even clearer and more distinct impression, it may still turn out to be false. Based on the way it appears, you can never know whether it is a true impression or a false one that is qualitatively identical to the true one. The possibility of error inevitably enters if we must recognize an impression as cognitive for it to play its intended epistemic role.

In response to (4), the Stoics insisted that no two impressions can be identical (Ac. 2.50). So even though two impressions may seem identical, there will still be distinguishable features. In these sorts of cases we must sharpen our skills and refrain from assenting in the meantime (Ac. 2.56-57). But Cicero replies that it makes no difference whether the impressions are strictly identical or only indistinguishable to us (Ac. 2.85). The issue, as he understands it, is whether we are ever actually in a position to accurately identify an impression as cognitive on the basis of its perceptual content.

This interpretation may be unfair to the Stoics however. At one point Lucullus, the spokesman for the Stoics in the Academica, compares assenting to cognitive impressions to the sinking of a scale’s balance when weight is put on it. The mind necessarily yields and cannot refrain from giving its approval to what is perspicuous. (Ac. 2.38) Sextus also attributes this view to later Stoics: when the cognitive impression lacks any obstacles it lays hold of us by the hair and practically drags us to assent. (M 7.257) In the end, assent must still be voluntary. But what these passages suggest is some sort of natural fit between cognitive impressions and our rational faculty such that cognitive impressions are, at least potentially, compelling in a way that false impressions cannot be. According to this view, cognitive impressions affect the properly trained mind in a way that is quite different from the way false impressions affect the same mind. If there is this natural fit between cognitive impressions and our rational faculty, then perhaps it is possible after all to acquire the necessary level of discernment to guarantee that one will only assent to cognitive impressions.

Even so, Cicero was apparently satisfied that the Stoics had not succeeded in showing that cognitive impressions provide us with a criterion of truth in practice. He was more convinced by the seemingly limitless supply of false impressions that we cannot currently distinguish from true ones than by the remote possibility of developing our powers of discernment to overcome such possible deceptions.

3. Indirect Arguments in Support of Stoic Epistemology in the Academica

Lucullus also presents some indirect arguments. He assumes the truth of Cicero’s Academic position (akatalêpsia, that is, the denial of the possibility of katalêpsis) and derives unacceptable consequences. There are two types of such argument: first that akatalêpsia is self-refuting or inconsistent (Ac. 2.33, 44, 58, cf. also 111), and second that akatalêpsia removes the possibility of certain sorts of successful action, especially virtuous action (Ac. 2.19-27, 32-39). These are versions of the two most often repeated arguments against virtually every ancient skeptic. In this context, however, they are specifically tailored as responses to the rejection of the Stoic criterion.

First, consider the charge that akatalêpsia is self-refuting. Lucullus remarks that the Academics’ crucial premise (4) tells us that there are (or at least may be) no differences between any given true impression and a false one. And yet the Academics also claim that some impressions are true and some are false, and this implies that there is some difference between them. (Ac. 2.44) Thus in rejecting katalêpsis, the Academics inconsistently argue that there is and there is not a difference between any given true impression and a false one.

There is an easy rejoinder available. Cicero need only claim that there are no perceptual differences between any given true impression and a false one. This is consistent with saying that there are causal differences, specifically that true impressions come from what is the case and false ones do not. Cicero does not deny that truth exists, but rather that we can grasp it with certainty. (Ac. 2.111) So the problem lies not with the world, but rather with our inability to develop our powers of discernment to the level required by the Stoic theory. No matter how much practice we may have at distinguishing eggs, there may always be a pair of eggs whose similarities exceed our ability.

But Lucullus’ objection is not merely that akatalêpsia entails the impossibility of correctly identifying which of my impressions are true. His objection also includes the claim that akatalêpsia entails the eradication of any adequate conception of truth. (Ac. 2.33) If we have no adequate conception of truth, however, we cannot consistently assert that some impressions are true and some are false. In other words, we should not accept that there is a real distinction between truth and falsity, right and wrong, or any other pair, unless we are confident that our corresponding conceptions of each accurately reveal this distinction. Granting this point, the difficulty for the Stoics lies in explaining why akatalêpsia entails the eradication of any adequate conception of truth in the first place.

Unfortunately, Lucullus does not elaborate on this point. But the explanation must have something to do with the Stoic view of oikeiôsis, the providential process by which Nature guides the moral and intellectual development of all human beings. In sketching the Stoic view of oikeiôsis, we will also arrive at the second sort of objection mentioned above, namely that akatalêpsia removes the possibility of certain sorts of successful action, especially virtuous action.

The Stoics believe that Nature implants in each of us a love of ourselves that is expressed in our primary and earliest drive towards self-preservation. We are naturally disposed to choose what is in accordance with our nature and reject what is opposed or harmful to it. As a result of this innate tendency, we all inevitably develop accurate conceptions (prolêpseis) of what is helpful and what is harmful with respect to self-preservation. This explains, among other things, the instinctive drive of newborns to nurse: the breast is perceived as beneficial.

These naturally developed conceptions must be veridical in keeping with the providence of nature. If they were misleading it would threaten our existence as a species, and it would be impossible to develop such faulty conceptions further into the organized bodies of knowledge exhibited in skillful activity. Nature does not guarantee that we will develop our naturally acquired conceptions into systematic bodies of knowledge and ultimately into virtuous dispositions; neither does Nature guarantee that all acorns will grow into magnificent oaks. But the raw material is provided in both cases.

Assenting to cognitive impressions is essential to the process by which we develop our naturally developed conceptions (prolêpseis) into the more precise conceptions (ennoiai) that regulate our rational judgments. For example, in De Finibus 3, Cicero’s Stoic spokesman Cato describes the process by which our natural disposition towards self-preservation is transformed into a true conception of the good. Our drive for self-preservation leads us to accurate conceptions of what is valuable or beneficial. Then, if we reason correctly about the nature of this value, we gradually discern what is genuinely valuable, the good itself. (De Finibus 3.16 ff.) But again it would not be possible to arrive at a true conception of the good if the raw material were somehow misleading.

Lucullus remarks that the mind “seizes some impressions [presumably cognitive ones] in order to make immediate use of them, others, which are the source of memory, it stores away so to speak, while all the rest it arranges by their likenesses, and thereby conceptions of things are produced…” (Ac. 2.30, tr. Long and Sedley [= LS] 40N) So we arrive at our conceptions in general by performing mental operations on sensory experience. (cf. Diogenes Laertius 7.53) If we cannot rely on the accuracy of sensory experience, that is if we deny the possibility of katalêpsis, then it will be impossible to form an accurate conception of truth, or anything else. This in turn undermines our ability to distinguish the true from the false in general.

Cognitive impressions are thus part of a natural fit between the world and our rational faculties—they indicate a basic or immediate way in which the world is intelligible to us. By denying the existence of cognitive impressions, Lucullus claims the Academics obliterate this crucial link and render the world ultimately unintelligible. They “tear out the very tools or equipment of life, or rather they actually ruin the foundations of the whole of life and rob the living being itself of the mind which gives it life…” (Ac. 2.31, tr. LS 40N) And he asks, if the conceptions that we form on the basis of our experience “were false or imprinted by the kind of impressions which were indiscernible from false ones, how on earth could we make use of them?” (Ac. 2.22, tr. LS 40M, cf. Ac. 2.19-20) Lucullus must mean “how could we successfully make use of them?”—otherwise, we could simply say “poorly and unreliably.” His question presupposes the apparent success we have had in organizing sensory experience into the systematic bodies of knowledge that are employed in skillful activities. To account for this success he thinks we must acknowledge that some impressions are cognitive.

The denial of katalêpsis also eliminates the possibility of virtue or wisdom. If we cannot form an accurate conception of the good, then we can never be sure that any of our particular actions are in fact good. Personifying wisdom, Lucullus remarks that she cannot possibly be wisdom if she is doubtful and in ignorance regarding the ultimate good which provides the measure against which we evaluate everything. (Ac. 2.24) For example, suppose I assent to the proposition that it is good for me to teach my students about skepticism. The Stoics believe that if my conception of the good is incorrect, or even if I do not know whether it is correct, the resulting action is not virtuous. It may be the right thing to do, but virtue requires that I know it is right, and that my conviction is unshakeable by any argument. Katalêpsis provides the basis for such certainty. The denial of katalêpsis thus removes the possibility of virtue.

The most obvious weakness of these objections is the extent to which they presuppose controversial elements of the Stoic system. Unless the skeptical opponent accepts these elements, the objections have no force. But Cicero does respond to these objections, perhaps because he accepts much of the Stoic system, though in the provisional way characteristic of an Academic. In his defense of the Academic position he shows how successful and skillful action and even virtue are possible without katalêpsis.

4. The Positive Fallibilism of the Philonian Academy

The development of a positive alternative to Stoic katalêpsis is generally thought to be the result of a misinterpretation of the earlier Academics’ more radical skepticism, especially Carneades‘ skepticism. The radical variety makes no provisions for acquiring beliefs; having successfully refuted every available (if not possible) position, the skeptic’s only option is to suspend judgment and believe nothing. The moderate variety, by contrast, aims at acquiring the most rationally defensible position with the full awareness of one’s fallibility.

Cicero insists that Academics do not deny the existence of true impressions; they deny only the possibility of an infallible grasp of them. He offers no explicit defense for the claim that true impressions exist, but he does recognize the existence of technical expertise; the general accuracy of our impressions would then provide the best explanation for this fact. Thus far he is in agreement with Lucullus: there could be no technical expertise if there were absolutely no distinction between true and false impressions. Technical expertise seems to presuppose that most of the impressions we rely on are in fact true.

Such reliability, however, is completely independent of our ability to infallibly differentiate true from false. As long as we make a responsible and cautious use of our impressions, always allowing for the possibility of error, the occasional deception is no serious cause for alarm.

In response to the Stoic objections that akatalêpsia would lead to inaction, the Academics did suggest that we may get along very well by relying on what appears to be subjectively plausible: Arcesilaus refers to this as what is reasonable (to eulogon), and Carneades as what is plausible (to pithanon). Cicero translates these Greek terms with one of his most important philosophical coinages, probabilitas. Regardless of what his predecessors intended by their skeptical alternatives, Cicero clearly intends that probabilitas is somehow like the truth. He frequently uses probabile and veri simile interchangeably (Ac. 2.7-9, 32, 99, Tusculan Disputations 1.17, 2.5).

Furthermore, he acknowledges that probabilitas is useful both “in the conduct of life and in philosophical investigation and discussion” (Ac. 2.32). So it seems that Cicero is not concerned exclusively with explaining relatively mundane successes like our ability to navigate, or even the more noteworthy successes of science, but also the possibility of making progress philosophically. Indeed, he maintains, both in the Academic books and elsewhere, that virtue is possible without Stoic katalêpsis. This is evident in the character of the “Academic sage.”

The Academic sage “is not afraid lest he may appear to throw everything into confusion and make everything uncertain. For if a question be put to him about duty or about a number of other matters in which practice has made him an expert, he would not reply in the same way as he would if questioned as to whether the number of stars is even or odd, and say that he did not know; for in things uncertain there is nothing probable, but in things where there is probability the wise man will not be at a loss either what to do or what to answer” (Ac. 2.110, tr. by H. Rackham). Guided solely by probabilitas, the sage will plan out his entire life (Ac. 2.99).

Cicero is much less forthcoming with regard to the details of how the sage employs probabilitas in adjudicating competing philosophical claims. But that the sage does employ probabilitas in this way is evident from the fact that he accepts the denial of the possibility of katalêpsis as probable. (Ac. 2.110) Such a decision indicates that the sage has weighed both sides of the debate and arrived at his probable judgment as a result.

It is likely that Cicero is following Philo’s adaptation of Carneades’ account of how we should test our sensory impressions when in doubt. (This is most extensively reported by Sextus Empiricus, M 7.166-189, see also Ac. 2.78). In matters of relatively little importance, or when we don’t have time for a more thorough examination we rely on whatever seems immediately plausible. Even though unexamined, such impressions may strike us with varying degrees of force or vividness. But since every individual impression is accompanied by a host of other related impressions, we should examine these as well, time permitting. When none of these concurrent impressions seem false, or inconsistent with the impression in question, our belief is greater. In matters of the greatest importance, especially those pertaining to our happiness, we should go a step further and examine each of the concurrent impressions individually, cross-questioning each of them on the testimony of the others. (M 7.184)

Impressions that survive this scrutiny are most credible. But the degrees of credibility have no upper limit since cross-questioning may proceed indefinitely. What the higher levels of scrutiny have in common is that they are aimed primarily at disconfirmation (M 7.189). In the end, what reveals itself as most credible is what has survived the most extensive attempts at “refutation.”

Given that Cicero sees himself as engaged in the same philosophical practice as Carneades, it is likely that disconfirmation plays the same central role in the philosophical application of probabilitas as in the empirical application of Carneades’ criterion. So to employ this fallible criterion in philosophical investigation would require a serious and sustained effort to refute the view in question. If it survives such critical scrutiny, it will appear to be like the truth. Since we are dealing with degrees of justification, approximation to the truth most likely refers to the extent to which the view in question has been rationally defended. The further assumption underlying this is that the truth cannot be refuted. Surviving serious attempts at refutation would then provide inductive evidence of the truth of that view, and the more it survives the more it will appear to be like the truth.

Unlike the empirical cases, philosophical issues typically do not force a judgment. We may reflect indefinitely on whether justice is whatever the strong say it is whereas life-and-death, fight-or-flight, judgments cannot wait. This open-endedness is reflected in Cicero’s own consideration of the dispute between the Stoics and Peripatetics on the sufficiency of virtue for a happy [eudaimôn] life. Sometimes he was swayed by the Stoics’ position that virtue can guarantee a happy life with or without external goods like health and wealth. And sometimes he was swayed by the Peripatetic view that virtue requires at least some of those external goods to secure a happy life. The fact that Cicero continued to the end of his life to struggle with this issue does not mean that he failed as an Academic. Arriving once and for all at the philosophical view that can be most consistently maintained is not required; continuing to search for it is.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Latin Texts and Translations

  • Brittain, C., tr. 2006. Cicero: On Academic Scepticism, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
  • Long and Sedley, tr. 1987. The Hellenistic Philosophers, Volumes 1 and 2, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Long and Sedley provide translations of and commentary on a good portion of the Academica. Their volumes are indispensable to the study of Hellenistic philosophy in general, and the commentary on the selections from the Academica are extremely helpful.
  • Rackham, H., tr. 1933/1994. Cicero: De Natura Deorum, Academica, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • This volume in the Loeb Classical Library contains the Latin text with English translation on facing pages. It is currently the only English translation available of the Academic books in their entirety (as we have them).
  • Reid, J. S. 1885. M. Tulli Ciceronis, Academica, London: MacMillan.
    • For textual analysis and philosophical commentary, Reid’s edition is still valuable.

b. Select Bibliography of Secondary Literature

  • Brittain, C. 2001. Philo of Larissa: the Last of the Academic Sceptics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Though Brittain does not deal specifically with Cicero as a philosopher, he makes extensive use of the Academic books in reconstructing the positions held by Philo as well as the history of the Academy in general. This is a very carefully researched and comprehensive book. In addition to presenting a stimulating reconstruction of Philo’s views, there is a very useful appendix containing all the testimonia on Philo along with translations.
  • Glucker, J. 1978. Antiochus and the Late Academy, Hypomnemata 56, Göttingen.
  • Glucker, J. 1988. “Cicero’s Philosophical Affiliations,” in Dillon, J.M. and A.A. Long, eds., The Question of “Eclecticism”: Studies in Later Greek Philosophy, Berkeley.
  • Glucker, J. 1995. “Probabile, Veri Simile, and Related Terms,” in Powell, ed.
  • Görler, W. 1995. “Silencing the troublemaker: De Legibus 1.39 and the Continuity of Cicero’s Scepticism,” in Powell, ed.
    • This is a response to an earlier article by Glucker which argues that Cicero changed his affiliation twice, once from a youthful adherence to the skeptical Academy to the more dogmatic position of Antiochus, and then later in life back again.
  • Mansfeld, J. and B. Inwood, eds. 1997. Assent and Argument: Studies in Cicero’s Academic Books, Leiden: Brill.
    • This and the following volume are highly recommended as a starting point for further study in Cicero’s skepticism and the late Academy in general.
  • Powell, J.G.F., ed. 1995. Cicero the Philosopher, Oxford.
  • Tarrant, H. 1985. Scepticism or Platonism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Author Information

Harald Thorsrud
Email: hthorsrud@agnesscott.edu
New Mexico State University
U. S. A.

Last updated: September 7, 2006 | Originally published: