Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Cicero (106—43 B.C.E.)

cicero-02Marcus Tullius Cicero was born on January 3, 106 BC and was murdered on December 7, 43 BC. His life coincided with the decline and fall of the Roman Republic, and he was an important actor in many of the significant political events of his time, and his writings are now a valuable source of information to us about those events. He was, among other things, an orator, lawyer, politician, and philosopher. Making sense of his writings and understanding his philosophy requires us to keep that in mind. He placed politics above philosophical study; the latter was valuable in its own right but was even more valuable as the means to more effective political action. The only periods of his life in which he wrote philosophical works were the times he was forcibly prevented from taking part in politics.

While Cicero is currently not considered an exceptional thinker, largely on the (incorrect) grounds that his philosophy is derivative and unoriginal, in previous centuries he was considered one of the great philosophers of the ancient era, and he was widely read well into the 19th century. Probably the most notable example of his influence is St. Augustine’s claim that it was Cicero’s Hortensius (an exhortation to philosophy, the text of which is unfortunately lost) that turned him away from his sinful life and towards philosophy and ultimately to God. Augustine later adopted Cicero’s definition of a commonwealth and used it in his argument that Christianity was not responsible for the destruction of Rome by the barbarians.

Table of Contents

  1. Cicero’s life
  2. Cicero’s influence
  3. Cicero’s thought
  4. Cicero and the Academic Skeptics
  5. Cicero and Stoicism and Peripateticism
  6. Cicero and Epicureanism
  7. Cicero’s writings
    1. On Invention
    2. On the Orator
    3. On the Republic
    4. On the Laws
    5. Brutus
    6. Stoic Paradoxes
    7. The Orator
    8. Consolation
    9. Hortensius
    10. Academics
    11. On Ends
    12. Tusculan Disputations
    13. On the Nature of the Gods
    14. On Divination
    15. On Fate
    16. On Old Age
    17. On Friendship
    18. Topics
    19. On Duties
  8. Further reading on Cicero’s life
  9. Further reading on Cicero’s philosophy
    1. Texts by Cicero
    2. Texts about Cicero

1. Cicero’s life

Cicero’s political career was a remarkable one. At the time, high political offices in Rome, though technically achieved by winning elections, were almost exclusively controlled by a group of wealthy aristocratic families that had held them for many generations. Cicero’s family, though aristocratic, was not one of them, nor did it have great wealth. But Cicero had a great deal of political ambition; at a very young age he chose as his motto the same one Achilles was said to have had: to always be the best and overtop the rest. Lacking the advantages of a proper ancestry, there were essentially only two career options open to him. One was a military career, since military success was thought to result from exceptional personal qualities and could lead to popularity and therefore political opportunity (as was the case much later for American presidents Ulysses S. Grant and Dwight D. Eisenhower). Cicero, however, was no soldier. He hated war, and served in the military only very briefly as a young man.

Instead, Cicero chose a career in the law. To prepare for this career, he studied jurisprudence, rhetoric, and philosophy. When he felt he was ready, he began taking part in legal cases. A career in the law could lead to political success for several reasons, all of which are still relevant today. First, a lawyer would gain a great deal of experience in making speeches. Second, he (there were no female lawyers in Rome) could also gain exposure and popularity from high-profile cases. Finally, a successful lawyer would build up a network of political connections, which is important now but was even more important in Cicero’s time, when political competition was not conducted along party lines or on the basis of ideology, but instead was based on loose, shifting networks of personal friendships and commitments. Cicero proved to be an excellent orator and lawyer, and a shrewd politician. He was elected to each of the principle Roman offices (quaestor, aedile, praetor, and consul) on his first try and at the earliest age at which he was legally allowed to run for them. Having held office made him a member of the Roman Senate. This body had no formal authority — it could only offer advice — but its advice was almost always followed. He was, as can be imagined, very proud of his successes. (Though this is not the place for a long discussion of Roman government, it should be noted that the Roman republic was not a democracy. It was really more of an oligarchy than anything else, with a few men wielding almost all economic and political power).

During his term as consul (the highest Roman office) in 63 BC he was responsible for unraveling and exposing the conspiracy of Catiline, which aimed at taking over the Roman state by force, and five of the conspirators were put to death without trial on Cicero’s orders. Cicero was proud of this too, claiming that he had singlehandedly saved the commonwealth; many of his contemporaries and many later commentators have suggested that he exaggerated the magnitude of his success. But there can be little doubt that Cicero enjoyed widespread popularity at this time – though his policy regarding the Catilinarian conspirators had also made him enemies, and the executions without trial gave them an opening.

The next few years were very turbulent, and in 60 BC Julius Caesar, Pompey, and Crassus (often referred to today as the First Triumvirate) combined their resources and took control of Roman politics. Recognizing his popularity and talents, they made several attempts to get Cicero to join them, but Cicero hesitated and eventually refused, preferring to remain loyal to the Senate and the idea of the Republic. This left him open to attacks by his enemies, and in January of 58 BC one of them, the tribune Clodius (a follower of Caesar’s), proposed a law to be applied retroactively stating that anyone who killed a Roman citizen without trial would be stripped of their citizenship and forced into exile. This proposal led to rioting and physical attacks on Cicero, who fled the city. The law passed. Cicero was forbidden to live within 500 miles of Italy, and all his property was confiscated. This exile, during which Cicero could not take part in politics, provided the time for his first period of sustained philosophical study as an adult. After roughly a year and a half of exile, the political conditions changed, his property was restored to him, and he was allowed to return to Rome, which he did to great popular approval, claiming that the Republic was restored with him. This was also treated by many as an absurd exaggeration.

Cicero owed a debt to the triumvirate for ending his exile (and for not killing him), and for the next eight years he repaid that debt as a lawyer. Because he still could not engage in politics, he also had time to continue his studies of philosophy, and between 55 and 51 he wrote On the Orator, On the Republic, and On the Laws. The triumvirate, inherently unstable, collapsed with the death of Crassus and in 49 BC Caesar crossed the Rubicon River, entering Italy with his army and igniting a civil war between himself and Pompey (Caesar’s own account of this war still survives). Cicero was on Pompey’s side, though halfheartedly. He felt that at this point the question was not whether Rome would be a republic or an empire but whether Pompey or Caesar would be Emperor, and he believed that it would make little difference, for it would be a disaster in either case. Caesar and his forces won in 48 BC, and Caesar became the first Roman emperor. He gave Cicero a pardon and allowed him to return to Rome in July of 47 BC, but Cicero was forced to stay out of politics. Most of the rest of his life was devoted to studying and writing about philosophy, and he produced the rest of his philosophical writings during this time.

Caesar was murdered by a group of senators on the Ides of March in 44 BC. Cicero was a witness to the murder, though he was not a part of the conspiracy. The murder led to another power struggle in which Mark Antony (of “Antony and Cleopatra” fame), Marcus Lepidus, and Octavian (later called Augustus) were the key players. It also gave Cicero, who still hoped that the Republic could be restored, the opportunity for what is considered his finest hour as a politician. With Caesar dead, the Senate once again mattered, and it was to the Senate that Cicero made the series of speeches known as the Philippics (named after the speeches the Greek orator Demosthenes made to rouse the Athenians to fight Philip of Macedon). These speeches called for the Senate to aid Octavian in overcoming Antony (Cicero believed that Octavian, still a teenager, would prove to be a useful tool who could be discarded by the Senate once his purpose was served).

However, Antony, Lepidus, and Octavian were able to come to terms and agreed to share power. Each of them had enemies that he wanted eliminated, and as part of the power-sharing deal each got to eliminate those enemies. Antony put not only Cicero but also his son, his brother, and his nephew on the list of those to be killed (the Philippics are not very nice to him at all, especially the Second Philippic). Though Octavian owed his success in part to Cicero, he chose not to extend his protection to Cicero and his family. Cicero, his brother, and his nephew tried somewhat belatedly to flee Italy. His brother and nephew turned aside to collect more money for the trip, and were killed. Cicero kept going. Plutarch describes the end of Cicero’s life: “Cicero heard [his pursuers] coming and ordered his servants to set the litter [in which he was being carried] down where they were. He…looked steadfastly at his murderers. He was all covered in dust; his hair was long and disordered, and his face was pinched and wasted with his anxieties – so that most of those who stood by covered their faces while Herennius was killing him. His throat was cut as he stretched his neck out from the litter….By Antony’s orders Herennius cut off his head and his hands.” Antony then had Cicero’s head and hands nailed to the speaker’s podium in the Senate as a warning to others. Cicero’s son, also named Marcus, who was in Greece at this time, was not executed. He became consul in 30 BC under Octavian, who had defeated Antony after the Second Triumvirate collapsed. As consul, the younger Marcus got to announce Antony’s suicide to the Senate. It is unfortunate that we have no record of this speech.

2. Cicero’s influence

While Cicero is currently not considered an exceptional thinker, largely on the (incorrect) grounds that his philosophy is derivative and unoriginal, in previous centuries he was considered one of the great philosophers of the ancient era, and he was widely read well into the 19th century. Probably the most notable example of his influence is St. Augustine’s claim that it was Cicero’s Hortensius (an exhortation to philosophy, the text of which is unfortunately lost) that turned him away from his sinful life and towards philosophy and ultimately to God. Augustine later adopted Cicero’s definition of a commonwealth and used it in his argument that Christianity was not responsible for the destruction of Rome by the barbarians. Further discussion of Cicero’s influence on later philosophers can be found in MacKendrick, Chapter 20 and Appendix.

3. Cicero’s thought

Cicero subordinated philosophy to politics, so it should not surprise us to discover that his philosophy had a political purpose: the defense, and if possible the improvement, of the Roman Republic. The politicians of his time, he believed, were corrupt and no longer possessed the virtuous character that had been the main attribute of Romans in the earlier days of Roman history. This loss of virtue was, he believed, the cause of the Republic’s difficulties. He hoped that the leaders of Rome, especially in the Senate, would listen to his pleas to renew the Republic. This could only happen if the Roman elite chose to improve their characters and place commitments to individual virtue and social stability ahead of their desires for fame, wealth, and power. Having done this, the elite would enact legislation that would force others to adhere to similar standards, and the Republic would flourish once again. Whether this belief shows an admirable commitment to the principles of virtue and nobility or a blindness to the nature of the exceedingly turbulent and violent politics of his time, or perhaps both, is impossible to say with certainty.

Cicero, therefore, tried to use philosophy to bring about his political goals. Like most intellectual endeavors in Cicero’s time, philosophy was an activity in which Greece (and especially Athens) still held the lead. The Romans were more interested in practical matters of law, governance, and military strategy than they were in philosophy and art (many of Cicero’s writings include justifications for his study of philosophy and arguments that it ought to be taken seriously). But for Cicero to really use philosophy effectively, he needed to make it accessible to a Roman audience. He did this in part by translating Greek works into Latin, including inventing Latin words where none seemed suitable for Greek concepts (including the Latin words which give us the English words morals, property, individual, science, image, and appetite), and in part by drawing on and idealizing Roman history to provide examples of appropriate conduct and to illustrate the arguments of philosophy. He also summarized in Latin many of the beliefs of the primary Greek philosophical schools of the time (and he is the source of much of our knowledge about these schools). These included the Academic Skeptics, Peripatetics, Stoics, and Epicureans. Cicero was well acquainted with all these schools, and had teachers in each of them at different times of his life. But he professed allegiance throughout his life to the Academy.

4. Cicero and the Academic Skeptics

In Cicero’s time there were in fact two schools claiming to be descended from the First Academy, established by Plato. Cicero studied briefly in both the Old Academy and the New Academy; the differences between the two need not concern us. What they shared was their basic commitment to skepticism: a belief that human beings cannot be certain in their knowledge about the world, and therefore no philosophy can be said to be true. The Academic Skeptics offered little in the way of positive argument themselves; they mostly criticized the arguments of others.

This can be annoying, but it requires real mental abilities, including the ability to see all sides of an issue and to understand and accept that any belief, no matter how cherished, is only provisional and subject to change later if a better argument presents itself. It is the approach which underlies the modern scientific method, though the Academics did not use it in that way. Even something like evolution, for which there is mountains of evidence and seemingly no resonable alternative, is treated as a theory subject to change if needed rather than an eternal truth.

And it is this approach which Cicero embraced. This is not surprising if we consider again why he was interested in philosophy in the first place. As a lawyer, he would need to see as many sides of an argument as possible in order to argue his clients’ cases effectively. He would have to marshal all the available evidence in a methodical way, so as to make the strongest possible case, and he would have to accept that he might at any time have to deal with new evidence or new issues, forcing him to totally reconsider his strategies. As a politician, he would need a similar grasp of the issues and a similar degree of flexibility in order to speak and to act effectively. A lawyer or politician who fanatically sticks to a particular point of view and cannot change is not likely to be successful. Adopting the teachings of the Academy also allowed Cicero to pick and choose whatever he wanted from the other philosophical schools, and he claims to do this at various points in his writings. Finally, his allegiance to the Academy helps to explain his use of the dialogue form: it enables Cicero to put a number of arguments in the mouths of others without having to endorse any particular position himself.

However, Cicero did not consistently write as a member of the Academy. Skepticism can, if taken to extremes, lead to complete inaction (if we can’t be certain of the correctness of our decisions or of our actions, why do anything at all?) which was incompatible with Cicero’s commitment to political activity. Even if it isn’t taken that far, it can still be dangerous. It may not be a problem if trained, knowledgeable philosophers are skeptical about things like whether the gods exist or whether the laws are just. But if people in general are skeptical about these things, they may end up behaving lawlessly and immorally (see Aristophanes’ Clouds for a portrayal of this). Thus, while Cicero is willing to accept Academic Skepticism in some areas, he is not willing to do so when it comes to ethics and politics. For doctrines in these areas, he turns to the Stoics and Peripatetics.

5. Cicero and Stoicism and Peripateticism

Cicero believed that these two schools taught essentially the same things, and that the difference between them was whether virtue was the only thing human beings should pursue or whether it was merely the best thing to be pursued. According to the first view, things like money and health have no value; according to the second, they have value but nowhere near enough to justify turning away from virtue to attain them. This was a difference with little practical consequence, so far as Cicero was concerned, and there is no need to take it up here.

Since, according to the teachings of the Academy, Cicero was free to accept any argument that he found convincing, he could readily make use of Stoic teachings, and he did so particularly when discussing politics and ethics. In the Laws, for example, he explicitly says that he is setting aside his skepticism, for it is dangerous if people do not believe unhesitatingly in the sanctity of the laws and of justice. Thus he will rely on Stoicism instead. He puts forth Stoic doctrines not dogmatically, as absolutely and always true, but as the best set of beliefs so far developed. We ought to adhere to them because our lives, both individually and collectively, will be better if we do. It is essentially Stoic ethical teachings that Cicero urges the Roman elite to adopt.

Stoicism as Cicero understood it held that the gods existed and loved human beings. Both during and after a person’s life, the gods rewarded or punished human beings according to their conduct in life. The gods had also provided human beings with the gift of reason. Since humans have this in common with the gods, but animals share our love of pleasure, the Stoics argued, as Socrates had, that the best, most virtuous, and most divine life was one lived according to reason, not according to the search for pleasure. This did not mean that humans had to shun pleasure, only that it must be enjoyed in the right way. For example, it was fine to enjoy sex, but not with another man’s wife. It was fine to enjoy wine, but not to the point of shameful drunkenness. Finally, the Stoics believed that human beings were all meant to follow natural law, which arises from reason. The natural law is also the source of all properly made human laws and communities. Because human beings share reason and the natural law, humanity as a whole can be thought of as a kind of community, and because each of us is part of a group of human beings with shared human laws, each of us is also part of a political community. This being the case, we have duties to each of these communities, and the Stoics recognized an obligation to take part in politics (so far as is possible) in order to discharge those duties. The Stoic enters politics not for public approval, wealth, or power (which are meaningless) but in order to improve the communities of which they are a part. If politics is painful, as it would often prove to be for Cicero, that’s not important. What matters is that the virtuous life requires it.

6. Cicero and Epicureanism

For the Epicurean philosophy Cicero had only disdain throughout most of his life, though his best friend Atticus was an Epicurean. This disdain leads him to seriously misrepresent its teachings as being based on the shameless pursuit of base pleasures, such as food, sex, and wine (the modern day equivalent being sex, drugs, and rock’n'roll). However, this is not what Epicurus, who founded the school, or his later followers actually taught. Epicurus did claim that nature teaches us that pleasure is the only human good, and that life should therefore be guided by the pursuit of pleasure. But he meant by pleasure the absence of pain, including the pain caused by desires for wealth, fame, or power. This did not mean living life as one long Bacchanalia. Instead it meant withdrawing from politics and public life and living quietly with friends, engaged in the study of philosophy, which provided the highest pleasure possible (think of a monastery without the Bible and the rigorous discipline). The notion that the life of philosophy is the most pleasant life, of course, also comes from Socrates. Epicureans were also publicly atheists. Their atheism was based on a theory of atomism, which they were the first to propose. Everything in the universe, they argued, was made up of atoms, including the heavenly bodies; the gods did not exist. This knowledge was not a cause of despair but a cause of joy, they believed, since one of the greatest human pains is the pain caused by the fear of death and what lies beyond it. According to the Epicureans, death simply meant the end of sensation, as one’s atoms came apart. Thus there was no reason to fear it, because there was no divine judgment or afterlife. The best known Epicurean is Lucretius, a contemporary of Cicero’s at Rome who Cicero may have known personally. Lucretius’ On the Nature of Things, available online, sets out Epicurean teachings.

It is easy to see why Cicero, a man deeply involved in politics and the pursuit of glory, would find any doctrine that advocated the rejection of public life repulsive. It is also easy to see why someone concerned with the reform of character and conduct would reject public atheism, since fear of divine punishment often prevents people from acting immorally. During his forced exile from politics at the end of his life, however, some of his letters claim that he has gone over to Epicureanism, presumably for the reasons he hated it previously. No longer able to take part in public life, the best he could hope for was the cultivation of private life and the pleasures that it had to offer. Since Cicero abandoned this idea as soon as the opportunity to return to public life arose, there is no reason to take his professed conversion seriously – unless we wish to see in it an example of changing his beliefs to reflect changing circumstances, and thus an example of his commitment to the Academy.

7. Cicero’s writings

Cicero’s written work can be sorted into three categories. None can be said to represent the “true” Cicero, and all of Cicero’s work, we must remember, has a political purpose. This does not make it worthless as philosophy, but it should make us cautious about proclaiming anything in particular to be what Cicero “really thought.” Also, as an Academic skeptic, Cicero felt free to change his mind about something when a better position presented itself, and this makes it even more difficult to bring his writing together into a coherent whole.

The first category of Cicero’s work is his philosophic writings, many of which were patterned after Plato’s or Aristotle’s dialogues. These writings, in chronological order, include On Invention, On the Orator, On the Republic, On the Laws, Brutus, Stoic Paradoxes, The Orator, Consolation, Hortensius, Academics, On Ends, Tusculan Disputations, On the Nature of the Gods, On Divination, On Fate, On Old Age, On Friendship, Topics, On Glory, and On Duties. Unfortunately, several of them have been lost almost entirely (Hortensius, on the value of philosophy, the Consolation, which Cicero wrote to himself on the death of his beloved daughter Tullia in order to overcome his grief, and On Glory, almost totally lost) and several of the others are available only in fragmentary condition (notably the Laws, which Cicero may never have finished, and the Republic, fragments of which were only discovered in 1820 in the Vatican). These will be discussed in more detail below. While each of them is dedicated and addressed to a particular individual or two, they were intended to be read by a wide audience, and even at the end of his life Cicero never gave up entirely on the hope that the Republic and his influence would be restored. Hence these are not purely philosophical writings, but were designed with a political purpose in mind, and we are entitled to wonder whether Cicero is being entirely candid in the opinions that he expresses. Also, the dialogue form is useful for an author who wishes to express a number of opinions without having to endorse one. As we have seen, Cicero’s skepticism would have made this an especially attractive style. We should not assume too quickly that a particular character speaks for Cicero. Instead we should assume that, unless he explicitly says otherwise, Cicero wanted all the viewpoints presented to be considered seriously, even if some or all of them have weaknesses.

The second category is the speeches Cicero made as a lawyer and as a Senator, about 60 of which remain. These speeches provide many insights into Roman cultural, political, social, and intellectual life, as well as glimpses of Cicero’s philosophy. Many of them also describe the corruption and immorality of the Roman elite. However, they have to be taken with a grain of salt, because Cicero was writing and delivering them in order to achieve some legal outcome and/or political goal and by his own admission was not above saying misleading or inaccurate things if he thought they would be effective. In addition, the speeches that we have are not verbatim recordings of what Cicero actually said, but are versions that he polished later for publication (the modern American analogy would be to the Congressional Record, which allows members of Congress the opportunity to revise the text of their speeches before they are published in the Record). In some cases (such as the Second Philippic) the speech was never delivered at all, but was merely published in written form, again with some political goal in mind.

Finally, roughly 900 letters to and from (mostly from) Cicero have been preserved. Most of them were addressed to his close friend Atticus or his brother Quintius, but some correspondence to and from some other Romans including famous Romans such as Caesar has also been preserved. The letters often make an interesting contrast to the philosophic dialogues, as they deal for the most part not with lofty philosophical matters but with the mundane calculations, compromises, flatteries, and manipulations that were part of politics in Rome and which would be familiar to any politician today. It is important to be cautious in drawing conclusions from them about Cicero’s “true” beliefs since they rely on an understanding between the sender and recipient not available to others, because they are often not the result of full reflection or an attempt at complete clarity and precision (after all, a friend can be counted on to know what you mean), and because many of them, like the speeches, were written with a political purpose in mind that may make them less than fully truthful and straightforward.

Space does not allow us to discuss Cicero’s speeches and letters. The serious student of Cicero, however, will not want to ignore them. What follows is a brief summary of the main points each of Cicero’s philosophical works.

a. On Invention

Written while Cicero was still a teenager, it is a handbook on oratory. Cicero later dismissed it and argued that his other oratorical works had superceded it.

b. On the Orator

A lengthy treatise, in the form of a dialogue, on the ideal orator. While it is full of detail which can be tedious to those who are not deeply interested in the theory of rhetoric, it also contains useful discussions of the nature of and the relationships among law, philosophy, and rhetoric. Cicero places rhetoric above both law and philosophy, arguing that the ideal orator would have mastered both law and philosophy (including natural philosophy) and would add eloquence besides. He argues that in the old days philosophy and rhetoric were taught together, and that it is unfortunate that they have now been separated. The best orator would also be the best human being, who would understand the correct way to live, act upon it by taking a leading role in politics, and instruct others in it through speeches, through the example of his life, and through making good laws.

c. On the Republic

This dialogue is, unfortunately, in an extremely mutilated condition. It describes the ideal commonwealth, such as might be brought about by the orator described in On the Orator. In doing so it tries to provide philosophical underpinnings for existing Roman institutions and to demonstrate that until recently (the dialogue is set in 129 BC) Roman history has been essentially the increasing perfection of the Republic, which is now superior to any other government because it is a mixed government. By this Cicero means that it combines elements of monarchy, aristocracy, and democracy in the right balance; the contemporary reader may well disagree. But even this government can be destroyed and is being destroyed by the moral decay of the aristocracy. Thus Cicero describes the importance of an active life of virtue, the foundations of community, including the community of all human beings, the role of the statesman, and the concept of natural law. It also includes the famous Dream of Scipio.

d. On the Laws

This dialogue is also badly mutilated, and may never have been finished. In it Cicero lays out the laws that would be followed in the ideal commonwealth described in On the Republic. Finding the source of law and justice, he says, requires explaining “what nature has given to humans; what a quantity of wonderful things the human mind embraces; for the sake of performing and fulfilling what function we are born and brought into the world; what serves to unite people; and what natural bond there is between them.” Philosophy teaches us that by nature human beings have reason, that reason enables us to discover the principles of justice, and that justice gives us law. Therefore any valid law is rooted in nature, and any law not rooted in nature (such as a law made by a tyrant) is no law at all. The gods also share in reason, and because of this they can be said to be part of a community with humanity. They care for us, and punish and reward us as appropriate. Much of what remains of this dialogue is devoted to religious law.

e. Brutus

This dialogue too is in a mutilated condition. It is a history of oratory in Greece and Rome, listing hundreds of orators and their distinguishing characteristics, weaknesses as well as strengths. There is also some discussion of oratory in the abstract. Cicero says that the orator must “instruct his listener, give him pleasure, [and] stir his emotions,” and, as in On the Orator, that the true orator needs to have instruction in philosophy, history, and law. Such a person will have the tools necessary to become a leader of the commonwealth. This dialogue is less inclined to the argument that the orator must be a good man; for example, Cicero says that orators must be allowed to “distort history [i.e. lie] in order to give more point to their narrative.”

f. Stoic Paradoxes

Not a dialogue; Cicero lays out six Stoic principles (called paradoxes) which the average listener would not be likely to agree with and tries to make them both understandable and persuasive to such a listener. It is, he says, an exercise in turning the specialized jargon of the Stoics into plain speech for his own amusement (which obviously does not require Cicero to actually agree with any of the Stoic beliefs). The beliefs discussed are as follows: moral worth is the only good; virtue is sufficient for happiness; all sins and virtues are equal; every fool is insane; only the wise man is really free; only the wise man is really rich. These topics are largely taken up again in the Tusculan Disputations. MacKendrick argues strenuously that this work is far more than an idle amusement, and that it showcases Cicero’s rhetorical skills as well as being an attack on his enemies.

g. The Orator

Written in the form of a letter on the topic of the perfect orator, it includes a defense of Cicero’s own oratorical style (Cicero was never known for his modesty). It emphasizes that the orator must be able to prove things to the audience, please them, and sway their emotions. It also includes the famous quote “To be ignorant of what occurred before you were born is to remain always a child.”

h. Consolation

This text is lost except for fragments cited by other authors. Cicero wrote it to diminish his grief over the death of his daughter Tullia through the use of philosophy. From his letters we know that it was not entirely successful.

i. Hortensius

his text is heavily fragmented and we can determine little more than its broad outline. It is written in order to praise philosophy, which alone can bring true happiness through the development of reason and the overcoming of passions. In antiquity it was widely read and very popular; it was instrumental in converting St. Augustine to Christianity.

j. Academics

The positions of the various philosophical schools on epistemology (how we can perceive and understand the world) and the possibility of knowing truth are set out and refuted by the participants in this dialogue (of which we have different parts of two editions). Cicero also incorporates a detailed history of the development of these schools following the death of Socrates (diagrammed nicely in MacKendrick; see below). The nature of Cicero’s own skepticism can be found in this work; the reader is left to choose the argument that is most persuasive.

k. On Ends

A dialogue which sets out the case, pro and con, of the several philosophic schools on the question of the end or purpose (what Aristotle called the telos) of human life. For Cicero, and arguably for ancient philosophy generally, this was the most important question: “What is the end, the final and ultimate aim, which gives the standard for all principles of right living and of good conduct?” Today many are inclined to believe that an answer to this question, if an answer exists at all, must be found in religion, but Cicero held that it was a question for philosophy, and this text was meant to popularize among the Romans the various answers that were being offered at the time. As with Academics, the reader must decide which case is most persuasive.

l. Tusculan Disputations

Another attempt to popularize philosophy at Rome and demonstrate that the Romans and their language had the potential to achieve the very highest levels of philosophy. The first book presents the argument that death is an evil; this argument is then refuted. The second book presents and refutes the argument that pain is an evil. The third book argues that the wise man will not suffer from anxiety and fear. In the fourth book Cicero demonstrates that the wise man does not suffer from excessive joy or lust. And in the fifth and final book Cicero argues that virtue, found through philosophy, is sufficient for a happy life. These positions are all compatible with Stoicism.

m. On the Nature of the Gods

This dialogue, along with the next two, was intended by Cicero to form a trilogy on religious questions. It offers desciptions of literally dozens of varieties of religion. Emphasis is especially placed on the Epicurean view (the gods exist but are indifferent about human beings), which is described and then refuted, and the Stoic view (the gods govern the world, love human beings, and after death reward the good and punish the bad), which is similarly stated and refuted. At the end of the dialogue the characters have not reached agreement. This is perhaps the dialogue that best illustrates Cicero’s skeptical method.

n. On Divination

This dialogue too, according to Cicero, is meant to set out arguments both for and against a topic, in this case the validity of divination (predicting the future through methods such as astrology, reading animal entrails, watching the flight of birds, etc.) without asserting that either side is correct. The case for the validity of divination is presented in the first book and then crushed in the second (in which Cicero himself is the main speaker). While Cicero explicitly says that he reserves judgment, it is hard to conclude that Cicero approved of divination, which he saw as drawing on superstition rather than religion. Religion was useful because it helped to control human behavior and could be used as a tool for public policy; and in this context divination could be useful too (as when an unwise political decision was prevented by the announcement that the omens were unfavorable).

o. On Fate

The text is fragmented. The topic discussed is whether or not human beings can be said to have free will, so much of the book deals with theories of causation and the meaning of truth and falsehood. Cicero apparently rejects the idea that fate determines all our actions and argues that human beings, to a significant extent, have free will.

p. On Old Age

In this dialogue, we learn that the sufferings of old age do not affect everyone equally but in fact are dependent on character; old men of good character continue to enjoy life, though in different ways than in their youth, while men of bad character have new miseries added to their previous ones. Nothing is more natural than to age and die, and if we are to live in accordance with nature (a Stoic teaching) we should face death calmly. If one has lived well, there are many pleasant memories to enjoy, as well as prestige and the intellectual pleasures that are highest of all.

q. On Friendship

This dialogue describes the nature of true friendship, which is possible only between good men, who are virtuous and follow nature. This friendship is based on virtue, and while it offers material advantages it does not aim at them or even seek them. The dialogue goes on to describe the bonds of friendship among lesser men, which are stronger the more closely they are related but which exist even in more distant relationships. The conclusion is reached that all human beings are bonded together, along with the gods, in a community made up of the cosmos as a whole and based on shared reason. There is, however, awareness of the fact that in the real world friendship can be a difficult thing to maintain due to political pressures and adversity. It also includes the assertion that Cato was better than Socrates because he is praised for deeds, not words, which is perhaps the center of Cicero’s personal philosophy (recall that he only wrote about philosophy, rhetoric and so on when political participation was denied to him by force), as well as the claim that love is not compatible with fear – a claim that Machiavelli found significant enough to explicitly reject in The Prince.

r. Topics

A toolkit for orators on the science of argument, touching on the law, rhetoric, and philosophy, and setting out the various kinds of arguments available to the orator, rules of logic, and the kinds of questions he may find himself facing. It has similarities to Aristotle’s Topics and part of his Rhetoric.

s. On Duties

Written in the form of a letter to his son Marcus, then in his late teens and studying philosophy in Athens (though, we can gather from the letters, not studying it all that seriously), but intended from the start to reach a wider audience. Cicero addresses the topic of duty (including both the final purpose of life, which defines our duties, and the way in which duties should be performed), and says that he will follow the Stoics in this area, but only as his judgment requires. More explicitly, the letter discusses how to determine what is honorable, and which of two honorable things is more honorable; how to determine what is expedient and how to judge between two expedient things; and what to do when the honorable and the expedient seem to conflict. Cicero asserts that they can only seem to conflict; in reality they never do, and if they seem to it simply shows that we do not understand the situation properly. The honorable action is the expedient and vice-versa. The bonds among all human beings are described, and young Marcus is urged to follow nature and wisdom, along with whatever political activity might still be possible, rather than seeking pleasure and indolence. On Duties, written at the end of Cicero’s life, in his own name, for the use of his son, pulls together a wide range of material, and is probably the best starting place for someone wanting to get acquainted with Cicero’s philosophic works.

8. Further reading on Cicero’s life

Plutarch’s “Life of Cicero” is the source of much of our knowledge of Cicero’s life. It should be kept in mind that Plutarch is writing a century after Cicero’s death and has no firsthand knowledge of the events he describes. He also writes to offer moral lessons, rather than simply record events. The Roman historian Sallust’s Conspiracy of Catiline offers a description of that conspiracy, written twenty years after it took place, which fails to give Cicero the same degree of importance he gave himself. Both of these texts are available online and in inexpensive Penguin editions. D.R. Shackleton Bailey, Cicero, incorporates many of Cicero’s own letters in describing Cicero and the events of his life; the reader gets a firsthand look at events and a taste of Cicero’s enjoyable prose style through these letters. Manfred Fuhrmann, Cicero and the Roman Republic, uses the same approach and also includes material from speeches and the philosophical writings. Christian Habicht, Cicero the Politician, is a short (99 pages of text) history of Cicero’s life and times. Its brevity makes it a useful starting point and overview. Even shorter (84 pages of text) is Thomas Wiedemann, Cicero and the End of the Roman Republic. Weidemann even finds room for photographs and drawings, which makes this book perhaps too short. R.E. Smith, Cicero the Statesman, focuses on the period from 71 BC-43 BC, which is the most active part of Cicero’s life. He gives a very clear exposition of Roman politics as well as Cicero’s part in it. Thomas Mitchell’s two volumes, Cicero, the Ascending Years (which covers Cicero’s life up to the end of his consulship) and Cicero the Senior Statesman (which covers the years from the end of his consulship to his death), in his words, aim to “provide a detailed and fully documented account of Cicero’s political life that combines the story of his career with a comprehensive discussion of the political ideas and events that helped shape it.” He succeeds admirably. There are also available a large number of general histories of the Roman Republic and empire which the reader is encouraged to explore.

9. Further reading on Cicero’s philosophy

a. Texts by Cicero

The standard versions of Cicero’s writings in English are still the Loeb editions of the Harvard University Press. They include the Latin text on the left hand pages and the English translation on the right hand pages, which is obviously of particular use to one who knows or is learning Latin. There are Loeb editions of all of Cicero’s speeches, letters, and philosophical writings known to exist, and they were the main sources for this article. The Perseus Project includes Cicero’s writings in its online archives. The series of Cambridge Texts in the History of Political Thought has recently added editions of On the Commonwealth and On the Laws (in one volume, edited by James E.G. Zetzel) and On Duties (edited by M.T. Griffin and E.M. Atkins). These volumes include the Cambridge series’ usual excellent introductions and background material and were also helpful in preparing this article. The Oxford World’s Classics series has recently released a new translation of On the Commonwealth and On the Laws (edited by Jonathan Powell and Niall Rudd); while its supplemental material is not as thorough as that of the Cambridge edition, it is still worth reading.

b. Texts by Cicero

Perhaps the best starting point is Neal Wood, Cicero’s Social and Political Thought. It includes chapters on Cicero’s life and times and then discusses Cicero’s thought in a number of areas (for example there are chapters entitled “The Idea of the State” and “The Art of Politics”); admittedly its focus de-emphasizes Cicero’s thought on religion, oratorical theory, and so on. A wider range of essays, which can best be appreciated after reading Cicero’s texts, can be found in J.G.F. Powell, editor, Cicero the Philosopher: Twelve Papers. Andrew R. Dyck, A Commentary on Cicero, De Officiis (On Duty), is exactly what it says; it is massive (654 pages), detailed, relies on the reader’s knowing Latin, and is of interest almost exclusively to the specialist. Paul MacKendrick, The Philosophical Books of Cicero, offers detailed summaries of each of Cicero’s philosophical writings, as well as brief discussions which include the issue of Cicero’s sources and originality for each text (Cicero is defended against the charges of unoriginality commonly made against him). It was extremely helpful in the preparation of this article. The final two chapters, as mentioned above, trace Cicero’s influence down through the centuries and conclude with the observation that “Americans, though denied by their educational system a widespread knowledge of the classics in the original, share with Cicero a sturdy set of ethical values, which it is to be hoped they will, in true Ciceronian fashion, still cleave to in time of crisis.”

Author Information

Edward Clayton
Central Michigan University
U. S. A.

Last updated: July 14, 2005 | Originally published: