Cleanthes was a Stoic philosopher of Assus in Lydia, and a disciple of Zeno of Citium. After the death of Zeno he presided over his school. He was originally a wrestler, and in this capacity he visited Athens, where he became acquainted with philosophy. Although he possessed no more than four drachma, he was determined to put himself under an eminent philosopher. His first master was Crates, the Academic. He afterward became Zeno's disciple and an advocate of his doctrines. By night he drew water as a common laborer in the public gardens so that he would have leisure to attend lectures in the daytime. The Athenian citizens observed that, although he appeared strong and healthy, he had no visible means of subsistence; they then summoned him before the Areopagas, according to the custom of the city, to give an account of his manner of living. He then produced the gardener for whom he drew water, and a woman for whom he ground meal, as witnesses to prove that he lived by the labor of his hands. The judges of the court were struck with such admiration of his conduct, that they ordered ten minae to be paid him out of the public treasury. Zeno, however, did not allow him to accept it. Antigonus afterward presented him with three thousand minae. From the manner in which this philosopher supported himself, he was called "the well drawer." For many years he was so poor that he was compelled to take notes on Zeno's lectures on shells and bones, since he could not afford to buy better materials. He remained, however, a pupil of Zeno for nineteen years.
His natural faculties were slow. But resolution and perseverance enabled him to overcome all difficulties. At last he became so complete a master of Stoicism that he was perfectly qualified to succeed Zeno. His fellow disciples often ridiculed him for his dullness by calling him an ass. However, his answer was, that if he were an ass he was the better able to bear the weight of Zeno's doctrine. He wrote much, but none of his writings remain except a hymn to Zeus. After his death, the Roman senate erected a statue in honor of him at Assus. It is said that he starved himself to death in his 99th year.
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