Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Cloning

In biology, the activity of cloning creates a copy of some biological entity such as a gene, a cell, or perhaps an entire organism. This article discusses the biological, historical, and moral aspects of cloning mammals. The main area of concentration is the moral dimensions of reproductive cloning, specifically the use of cloning in order to procreate.

The article summarizes the different types of cloning, such as recombinant DNA/molecular cloning, therapeutic cloning, and reproductive cloning. It explores some classic stereotypes of human clones, and it illustrates how many of these stereotypes can be traced back to media portrayals about human cloning. After a brief history of the development of cloning technology, the article considers arguments for and against reproductive cloning.

One of the most predominate themes underlying arguments for reproductive cloning is an appeal to procreative liberty. Because cloning may provide the only way for some individuals to have a child that is genetically their own, a ban on cloning interferes with their reproductive autonomy.

Arguments against cloning appeal to concerns about a clone’s lack of genetic uniqueness and what may be implied because of this. Human cloning is of special interest. There are concerns that cloned humans would lack individuality, that they would be treated in undignified ways by their creators, or that they would be damaged by society’s expectations that they should be more like those from whom they were cloned. Because they would essentially be facsimiles of the original person, there is concern that the clones might possess less moral worth. The predominate theme underlying arguments against human cloning is that the cloned child would undergo some sort of physical, social, mental, or emotional harm. Because of these and other concerns, the United Nations and many countries have banned human cloning. An important philosophical issue is whether such a response against human cloning is warranted.

Table of Contents

  1. Types of Cloning
    1. Recombinant DNA Technology / Molecular Cloning
    2. Therapeutic Cloning
    3. Reproductive Cloning
  2. Misconceptions About Cloning and Their Sources
  3. Cloning Mammals: A Brief History
  4. Arguments in Favor of Reproductive Cloning and Responses
    1. Reproductive Liberty: The Only Way to Have a Genetically Related Child
    2. Cloning and Savior Siblings
    3. Cloning In Order to “Replace” a Deceased Child
    4. The Resultant Loss of Therapeutic Cloning for Stem Cell Research and Treating Diseases
  5. Arguments Against Reproductive Cloning and Responses
    1. The Right to an Open Future
    2. The Right to a Unique Genetic Identity
    3. Cloning is Wrong because it is “Playing God” or because it is “Unnatural”
    4. The Dangers of Cloning
    5. Cloning Entails the Creation of Designer Children, or it Turns Children into Commodities
    6. Cloning and the Ambiguity of Familial Roles
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Types of Cloning

a. Recombinant DNA Technology / Molecular Cloning

DNA/Molecular cloning has been in use by molecular biologists since the early 1960s. When scientists wish to replicate a specific gene to facilitate more thorough study, molecular cloning is implemented in order to generate multiple copies of the DNA fragment of interest. In this process, the specific DNA fragment is transferred from one organism into a self-replicating genetic element, e.g., a bacterial plasmid (Allison, 2007).

Because this kind of cloning does not result in the genesis of a human organism, it has no reproductive intent or goals, and it does not result in the creation and destruction of embryos, there is little to no contention regarding its use.

b. Therapeutic Cloning

 

 

 

Embryonic stem cells are derived from human embryos at approximately five days post-fertilization, in the blastocyst stage of development. Because of their plasticity, embryonic stem cells can be manipulated to become any cell in the human body, e.g., neural cells, retinal cells, liver cells, pancreatic cells, or heart cells. Many scientists hope that, with proper research and application, embryonic stem cells can be used to treat a wide variety of afflictions, e.g., tissue toxicity resulting from cancer therapy (National Cancer Institute, 1999) Alzheimer’s disease (Gearhart, 1998), Parkinson’s disease (Freed et al, 1999; National Institute of Neurological Disorders and Strokes, 1999; Wager et al. 1999; Gearhart, 1998), diabetes (Voltarelli et al, 2007; Shapiro et al., 2000), heart disease (Lumelsky, 2001; Zulewski, 2001), and limb paralysis (Kay and Henderson, 2001).

One current obstacle for the successful use of embryonic stem cells for disease therapy concerns immunological rejection. If a patient were to receive stem cell therapy in order to treat some affliction, her body may reject the stem cells for the same reason human bodies have a tendency to reject donated organs: the body tends to not recognize, and therefore reject, foreign cells. One way to overcome stem cell rejection is by creating embryos through somatic cell nuclear transfer with the patient’s own DNA. In 2008, a California research team succeeded in creating embryos via SCNT and growing them to the blastocyst stage (French et al., 2008). In SCNT, an ovum is emptied of its own nucleus, its DNA, and the chromosomal DNA from another person (in the case, a patient’s) is inserted. The ovum is then artificially induced to begin dividing as if it had been naturally fertilized (usually via the use of an electrical current). Once the embryo is approximately five days old, the stem cells are removed, cultured, differentiated to the desired type of body cell, and inserted back into the patient (the genetic donor in this case). Since the embryo was a genetic duplicate of the patient, there would be no immunological rejection. One use of this technology, for example, is to help treat individuals in the aftermath of a heart attack. Using SCNT to create a genetically identical blastocyst, new healthy cells could be derived and inserted back into the genetic donor’s heart in order to replace the damaged cardiac cells (Strauer, 2009).

It may also be possible to use therapeutic cloning to repair defective genes by homologous recombination (Doetschman et al., 1987). Cellular models of diseases can be developed as well, along with the ability to test drug efficacy: “cloning a single skin cell from a patient with a disease could be used to produce inexhaustible amounts of cells and tissue with that disease. The tissue could be experimented upon to understand why disease occurs. It could be used to understand the genetic contribution to disease and to test vast arrays of new drugs which could not be tested in human people” (Savulescu, 2007, 1-2). Pluripotent stem cells can also be used to test drug toxicity which could also diminish the chances of drug-related birth defects (Boiani and Schöler, 2002, 124).

Therapeutic cloning is controversial because isolating the stem cells from the embryo destroys it. Many individuals regard the human embryo as a person with moral rights, and so they consider its destruction to be morally impermissible. Moreover, because the embryos are created with the explicit intention to destroy them, there are concerns that this treats the embryos in a purely instrumental manner (Annas et al.,, 1996). Although some ethicists are in favor of using surplus embryos from fertility treatments for research (since the embryos were slated for destruction in any case), they are simultaneously against creating embryos solely for research due to the concern that doing so treats the embryos purely as means (Outka, 2002; Peters, 2001). Indeed, it is precisely because of these ethical issues that some individuals object to the positive connotations of the term “therapeutic” and refer to this work, instead, as “research cloning.” The term “therapeutic cloning” is, however, more widely used.

c. Reproductive Cloning

SCNT can also be used for reproductive purposes. Unlike therapeutic cloning, the cloned embryo is transferred into a uterus of a female of the same species and would be, upon successful implantation, allowed to gestate as a naturally fertilized egg would. The cloned embryo would possess identical chromosomal DNA as its genetic predecessor, but, because of the use of a different ovum, its mitochondrial DNA (the genetic material inhabiting the cytoplasm of the enucleated ovum) would differ, and, consequently, it would not be 100% genetically identical (unlike monozygotic multiples who, because they are derived from the same ovum, share identical chromosomal and mitochondrial DNA). In addition to its slight genetic difference, the cloned embryo would likely be gestated in a different uterine environment, which can also have an effect in ways that may serve to distinguish it from its genetic predecessor. For example, a cloned entity’s phenotype (its appearance) may look very different than that of its genetic predecessor because the embryo can undergo epigenetic reprogramming, where nongenetic (i.e., environmental) causes influence genes to manifest themselves differently. The result is that the genes behave in ways that may lead to a difference in appearance.

In addition to somatic cell nuclear transfer, there is another, less controversial and less technologically complex, manner of reproductive cloning: artificial embryo twinning. Here, an embryo is created in a Petri dish via In Vitro Fertilization (IVF). The embryo is then induced to divide into genetic copies of itself, thereby artificially mimicking what happens when monozygotic multiples are formed (Illmensee et al., 2009). The embryos are then transferred into a womb and, upon successful implantation and gestation, are born as identical multiples. If implantation is unsuccessful, the process is repeated.

One argument in favor of artificial embryo twinning is that it provides an infertile couple, who may not have been able to produce many viable embryos through IVF, with more embryos that they can then implant for an increased chance at successful reproduction (Robertson, 1994). Because some of the embryos may be saved and implanted later, it is possible to create identical multiples who are not born at the same time. One advantage to doing this is that the later born twin could serve as a blood or bone marrow donor for her older sibling should the need arise; because they are genetically identical, the match would be guaranteed (the converse could also hold, that is, the older individual could serve as a donor for the clone should the latter ever need it. The existence of a cloned person, therefore, could be mutually beneficial, rather than asymmetrical). However, some concerns have been raised. For example, it has been argued that artificially dividing the embryo constitutes an immoral manipulation of it and that, as much as possible, a unique embryo should be allowed to develop without interference (McCormick, 1994). Concerns over individuality have also been raised; whereas naturally occurring twins are valued as individuals, one worry is that embryos created through artificial twinning, precisely because of the synthetic nature of their genesis, may not be as valued (McCormick, 1994).

2. Misconceptions About Cloning and Their Sources

The general public still seems to regard human reproductive cloning as something that can occur only in the realm of science fiction. The portrayal of cloning in movies, television, and even in journalism has spanned from comedic to dangerous. Human clones have often been depicted in movies as nothing but carbon copies of their genetic predecessor with no minds of their own (e.g., Multiplicity and Star Wars: Attack of the Clones), as products of scientific experiments that have gone horribly wrong, resulting in deformed quasi-humans (Alien Resurrection) or murderous children (Godsend), as persons created simply for spare parts for their respective genetic predecessor (The Island), or as deliberate recreations of famous persons from the past who are expected to act just like their respective predecessor (The Boys from Brazil). Even when depicting nonhuman cloning, films (such as Jurassic Park) tend to portray products of cloning as menacing, modern-day Frankensteinian monsters of sorts, which serve to teach humans a lesson about the dangers of “playing God.”

Many other media outlets, although usually shying away from the ominous representation of clones so prevalent in the movies, have usually portrayed clones as, essentially, facsimiles of their genetic predecessor. On the several occasions which Time Magazine has addressed the issue of cloning, the cover illustrates duplicate instances of the same picture. For example, the February 19, 2001 cover shows two mirror image infants staring at each other, the tagline suggesting that cloning may be used by grieving parents who wish to resurrect their dead child. Even a Discovery Channel program, meant to educate its viewers on the nature of cloning, initially portrays a clone as nothing more than a duplicate of the original person. Interestingly enough, however, a few minutes into the program, the narrator, speaking over a picture of two identical cows, says: “But even if a clone person is created, that doesn’t mean it would be an exact copy of the original.” Yet almost immediately afterwards, the same narrator calls a clone “You, version 2.0.”

As philosopher Patrick Hopkins has pointed out, media conceptions about what human cloning entails, and the type of offspring that will arise from cloning, employ the tacit premise that clones are nothing but copies. The predominate belief that fuels this conception is that genetic determinism is true, i.e., that a person’s genes are the sole determining factor of her behavior and physical appearance; essentially, that a person’s identity is solely determined by her genetic constitution. If a person were to believe that genetic determinism is true, then it follows that she believes that a cloned person would be psychologically identical with her genetic predecessor because they are (almost) genetically identical. Hopkins also points out that, like the narrator in the Discovery Channel program, many media outlets “engage in confusing, contradictory bits of double-talk (or double-show). The images and not-very-clever headlines all convey unsettling messages that clones will be exact copies, while inside the stories go to some effort to educate us that clones will not in fact be exact copies” (1998, 129-130).

3. Cloning Mammals: A Brief History

In 1894, Hans Driesch cloned a sea urchin through inducing twinning by shaking an embryonic sea urchin in a beaker full of sea water until the embryo cleaved into two distinct embryos. In 1902, Hans Spemann cloned a salamander embryo through inducing twinning as well, using a hair from his infant son as a noose to divide the embryo.  In 1928, Spemann successfully cloned a salamander using nuclear transfer. This involved enucleating a single-celled salamander embryo and inserting it with the nucleus of a differentiated salamander embryonic cell.  In 1951, Robert Briggs and Thomas Kling, using Spemann’s methods of embryonic nucleus transfer, successfully cloned frogs. In 1962, John Gurdon announced that he too had successfully cloned frogs but, unlike Briggs and Kling’s method, he did so by transferring differentiated intestinal nuclei from feeding tadpoles (Wilmut et al., 2000). Gurdon’s successful use of differentiated nuclei, rather than the embryonic nuclei used by Briggs and Kling, was particularly surprising to the scientific community. Because embryonic cells are undifferentiated, and therefore extremely malleable, it was not too surprising that transferred embryonic nuclei produced distinct embryos when inserted into an enucleated oocyte. However, inciting differentiated nuclei to behave as undifferentiated nuclei was thought to be impossible, since the conventional wisdom at the time was that once a cell was differentiated (e.g., once it became a cardiac cell, a liver cell, or a blood cell) it could never reverse into an undifferentiated state. It was for this reason that, for a long time, creating a cloned embryo from adult somatic cells was thought to be impossible – it would require taking long-time differentiated cells and getting them to behave like the totipotent cells (cells that are able to differentiate into any cell type, including the ability to form an entirely distinct organism) found in newly fertilized eggs.

In 1995, Dr. Ian Wilmut and Dr. Keith Campbell successfully cloned two mountain sheep, Megan and Morag, from embryonic sheep cells. One year later, in 1996, Wilmut and Campbell successfully cloned the first mammal to be born from an adult somatic cell, specifically an udder cell (a sheep’s mammary gland): Dolly the sheep (Wilmut et al., 1997). In other words, Wilmut and Campbell were able to take a fully differentiated adult cell and revert it back to an undifferentiated, totipotent, state. This was the first time the process had been accomplished for mammalian reproduction. Furthermore, they were able to create a viable pregnancy and produce from it a healthy lamb (however, there were 276 failed attempts before Dolly was created, which, as it will be discussed below, creates concerns over the safety and efficacy of the procedure). Dolly the sheep died in 2003 after having been euthanized due to her suffering from pulmonary adenomatosis, a disease fairly common in sheep that are kept indoors; indeed, many members of Dolly’s flock had succumbed to the same disease. Additionally, she suffered from arthritis. Before she died, she produced six healthy lambs through natural reproduction. Since Dolly, many more mammals have been cloned through the use of SCNT. Some examples are deer, ferrets (Li et al., 2006), mules (Lovgren, 2003), other sheep, goats, cows, mice, pigs, rabbits, a gaur, dogs, and cats. One possible use of reproductive cloning technology is to help save endangered species (Lanza et al., 2000). In 2005, two endangered gray wolves were cloned in Korea (Oh et al., 2008).

The successful cloning of household pets holds special significance in that, when discussing the circumstances that led to their cloning, we can begin to discuss the ethical issues that arise in human reproductive cloning. In 2001, the first feline created via somatic cell nuclear transfer was born. She was named CC, short for “Copy Cat,” and was born at the College of Veterinary Medicine at Texas A&M University. The research that led to her creation was funded by the California based company “Genetic Savings and Clone,” who, between 2004 and 2006, offered grieving pet owners a chance to clone their sick or deceased pets (they closed their doors in 2006 due to the unsustainability of their business). What is most striking about CC is not simply her mere existence, but also that CC does not look nor act like her feline progenitor, Rainbow. Whereas Rainbow, a calico, is stocky and has patches of tan, orange, and white throughout her body, CC barely resembles a calico at all. Not only is she lanky and thin, she has a grey coat over a white body and is lacking the patches of orange or tan typical to calicos. There are personality differences between Rainbow and CC as well; whereas Rainbow is described as a shy, reticent, and a more “hands-off” kind of cat, CC is described as more playful, inquisitive, and affectionate (Hays, 2003).

“Genetic Savings and Clone” was founded by Lou Hawthorne, who was seeking a means to clone his family’s beloved dog Missy. Although Missy died before she was successfully cloned, Hawthorne banked her DNA in the hopes of ultimately succeeding in this endeavor. In 2004, a Texas woman paid $50,000 to clone her deceased Maine Coone Nicky and, as a result, Little Nicky, the world’s first commercially cloned cat, was born.  This was followed, in 2005, by the birth of Snuppy, the world’s first cloned dog. In 2007, three clones from Missy’s DNA were created and returned to the Hawthorne family. All this has incited some pet owners to pay large sums of money to clone their beloved deceased pets. Alan and Kristine Wolf paid thousands of dollars to have their deceased cat, Spot, cloned from skin cells they had preserved. According to the Wolfs, preserving Spot’s skin cells, in their mind, was almost equivalent to having Spot himself preserved. In other words, the Wolfs (and the woman who cloned Nicky) were willing to spend an exorbitant amount of money to clone their pets not just in order to receive another pet, but to, rather, receive what was, in their eyes, the same pet that they had lost (Masterson, 2010).

This allows us to begin exploring the ethical issues in the reproductive cloning debate. Some questions that arise are: Why did these individuals regard the recreation of the same DNA to equate to the recreation of the same entity that had died? Will these expectations transfer over to human cloning, where people will regard cloned children as the same individuals as their genetic predecessors, and therefore treat them with this expectation in mind? Will cloning, thus, compromise a child’s identity? Are such concerns grave enough to permanently ban reproductive cloning altogether?

4. Arguments in Favor of Reproductive Cloning and Responses

a. Reproductive Liberty: The Only Way to Have a Genetically Related Child

The Argument.

Procreative liberty is a right well established in Western political culture (Dworkin, 1994). However, not everyone is physically capable of procreating through traditional modes of conception. Cloning may be the only way for an otherwise infertile couple to have a genetically related child. Therefore, providing cloning as an option contributes to a greater scope of procreative liberty (Häyry, 2003; Harris, 2004; Robertson, 1998). For example, a couple may be able to generate only a few embryos from IVF procedures; cloning via artificially induced twinning would increase the number of embryos to a quantity that is more likely to result in a live birth. In another case, the male partner in a relationship may be unable to produce viable sperm and, instead of seeking a sperm donor, the couple can choose to use SCNT in order to produce a genetic copy of the prospective father. Since the prospective mother would use her own ova, they would both contribute genetically to the child (albeit with a different proportion than a couple who conceived using gamete cells).  In yet another example, neither parent may have usable gametes, so they employ a donor ovum, clone one of the two parents, and gestate the fetus in the female’s uterus. Or, perhaps one of the prospective parents is predisposed to certain genetic disorders and, in order to completely avoid their offspring inheriting these disorders, they decide to clone the other prospective parent. A single woman may want to have a baby, and would rather clone herself instead of using donated sperm. Also, cloning may give homosexual couples the opportunity to have genetically related children (this is especially true for homosexual women where one partner provides the mitochondrial DNA and the other partner provides the chromosomal DNA). These are a few examples of how cloning may provide a genetically related child to a person otherwise unable to have one. Because cloning may be the only way some people can procreate, to deny cloning to these people would be a violation of procreative liberty (Robertson, 2006).

Response 1: Negative vs. positive right to procreate.

One response is to distinguish between a positive right to procreate and a negative right to procreate (Pearson, 2007), and argue that reproductive liberty can be fully respected in the latter sense, and only conditionally respected in the former sense. This conditional respect may support the permissibility of prohibiting human cloning for reproductive purposes.

A negative right to x means that no one has the prima facie right to interfere in your request to fulfill x.  If you possess a negative right to x, this entails only one obligation on the behalf of others: the obligation to not obstruct your obtainment of x. For example, if I have a negative right to life, what this entails is that others have an obligation to not kill me, since this obstructs or hinders my right. Another way to regard it is that a negative right only requires passive obligations (the obligation to not do something or to refrain from acting).

A positive right requires more from obligation-bearers; it requires that active steps be taken in order to provide the right-bearers with the means to fulfill that right. If I have a positive right to life, for instance, it is not just that others have an obligation to not kill me; they have a further obligation to provide me with any services that I would need to ensure my survival. That is, the obligation becomes an active one as well as a passive one: an obligation to not destroy my life and also to provide services that enable me to preserve my life.

Keeping this distinction in mind, it is possible to deny that the right to reproduce is a positive right in the first place. That is, while we ought not to prevent anyone from procreating, we are not required to provide them with any technology whatsoever in order to enable them to procreate if they cannot do so by their own means. Hence, limiting access to certain types of assisted reproductive technologies to an otherwise infertile couple would not necessarily infringe on their (negative) right to procreate (Courtwright and Doron, 2007). Some have argued the opposing side, however, and have maintained that respect for procreative liberty not only entails access to artificial reproductive technology, but also the right to employ gamete donors and surrogate mothers (Ethics Committee of the American Fertility Society, 1985).

Response 2: Procreative liberty is not categorical.

Another possible response is to stress that, even if there is a positive right to procreate, the right is a prima facie, rather than a categorical, one and it is not the case that any step taken to combat infertility is in itself ethical (McCormick, 1993).  Therefore, determining what types of services can be offered to infertile couples must be tempered with certain considerations, e.g., the safety of the offspring born as a result of these services must be taken into account. If a particular type of reproductive technology poses a health risk to the resulting children, this is grounds enough to prevent the use of that technology (Cohen, 1996). In other words, even granting that individuals have a positive right to procreate, it does not follow from this alone that they should be provided with any means necessary for successful procreation. They may not be entitled to the use of a certain technological advancement (e.g., SCNT) if that advancement is deemed to pose a danger to the resulting offspring. Robertson concedes this objection, but he responds that “if a ban on cloning is justified, then a ban on many other forms of assisted reproduction and genetic selection should be as well, yet few persons are prepared to go that far” (2006, 206).  That is, in order for advocates of this objection to be consistent, they should be equally willing to ban other forms of reproductive technology that may result in harm to potential offspring.

b. Cloning and Savior Siblings

The Argument.

The concept of a “savior sibling,” a child that is deliberately conceived so that she could provide a means (through the donation of bodily fluids, umbilical cord blood, a non-vital organ, or tissue) to save an older sibling from illness or death is not new. What is new is that cloning would ensure that the new child is an appropriate match for the existing ailing person, since they would be genetically identical. Permitting cloning, therefore, would allow for a more expedient means of creating a savior sibling, since the alternatives (using preimplantation genetic diagnosis to screen embryos to determine which are genetically compatible with the sibling, implanting into a womb only the ones that are a match and discarding the others, or creating an embryo through natural reproduction and terminating the pregnancy if it is not a genetic match) are more involved and more time consuming. Of course, the rights of the new child would have to be respected; tissue, organs, or bodily fluids should only be removed given her consent (although this would not apply to umbilical cord blood banking, since the infant lacks the capacity for giving consent) (Robertson, 2006).

Response: Violating Kant’s formula of humanity.

Such a prospect raises concerns that cloning would facilitate viewing the resulting children as objects of manufacture, rather than as individuals with value and dignity of their own. The prospect of creating a child, solely to meet the needs of another child and not for her own sake, reduces the created child to a mere means to achieve the ends of the parents and the sick child. While it is admirable that the parents wish to save their existing child, it is not ethically permissible to create another child solely as an instrument to save the life of her sibling (Quintavalle, 2001).

Another way of explaining it is that creating a child solely for the purposes of providing life-saving aid for another child violates Immanuel Kant’s second principle formulation of the categorical imperative. Kant proscribes treating persons as a mere means, rather than as ends in themselves, maintaining that persons should “act in such a way that [humanity is treated] always at the same time as an end and never simply as a means” (1981, 36). Creating a child for the sole purpose of saving another child violates the formula of humanity because the child is created specifically for this end.

It should be noted, however, that such an objection would apply to any method that is used to create a child for similar reasons, including any other type of reproductive technology or even natural procreation. It is the intention with which a child is created that is in question here, not the method that is used in order to create the child. Another response is that Kant’s dictum is misapplied. A child who is created as a “savior sibling” may still, also, be loved and respected as an individual in her own right, and therefore may not necessarily be treated solely as a means (Boyle and Savulescu, 2001).

c. Cloning In Order to “Replace” a Deceased Child

The Argument.

In his article “Even If It Worked, Cloning Won’t Bring Her Back”, ethicist Thomas Murray recounts a letter he heard read at a congressional hearing regarding human reproductive cloning. A chemist, who was presenting her views in support of reproductive cloning, read a letter by a father grieving the death of his infant son. Murray recounts as follows:

Eleven days ago, as I awaited my turn to testify at a congressional hearing on human reproductive cloning, one of five scientists on the witness list took the microphone. Brigitte Boisselier, a chemist working with couples who want to use cloning techniques to create babies, read aloud a letter from “a father (Dada).” The writer, who had unexpectedly become a parent in his late thirties, describes his despair over his 11-month-old son’s death after heart surgery and 17 days of “misery and struggle.” The room was quiet as Boisselier read the man’s words: “I decided then and there that I would never give up on my child. I would never stop until I could give his DNA – his genetic make-up – a chance” (2001).

Depriving grieving parents of this unique opportunity, the only opportunity “to get back the child that they lost,” would be morally wrong. Cloning would provide such an opportunity to grieving parents.

Response 1: Assuming genetic determinism.

Like many of the arguments against reproductive cloning listed below, this argument in favor of cloning, despite its emotional appeal, erroneously assumes that genetic determinism is true. The grieving father’s letter maintained that he would never “give up on my child”, and that the way he would achieve this is to “give his DNA – his genetic make-up – a chance.” In other words, the father equated his son as an individual person to his genetic make-up; because he could recreate his son’s genes, he could recreate his son as a person. The tacit implication here is that cloning is desirable because it somehow presents a way to cheat death. It is through cloning that his son could be, in some sense, resurrected.

Given that individuals have sought to clone their deceased pets, the idea that grieving parents would seek to clone a deceased child is not far-fetched. Thomas Murray continues his article by disclosing that he too is a grieving father, having suffered the death of his twenty-year-old daughter who was abducted from her college campus and shot. Yet cloning, Murray continues, “can neither change the fact of death nor deflect the pain of grief” (2001). Murray goes on to stress that, due to varying other influences outside of genetic duplication, a clone would not, in fact, be a mere copy of its genetic predecessor. One interesting point is that both detractors of cloning (e.g., Kass and Callahan, whose views are explored below) and supporters of cloning (like the researcher that read this letter at the congressional hearing) find convergence in committing the same fallacy. Both assume that cloning recreates identity, and they differ only as to the desirability of that consequence. Yet, given that we have evidence that the robust form of genetic determinism these arguments assume is false (Resnik and Vorhaus, 2006; Elliot, 1998), both detractors and supporters of cloning who rely on it produce faulty arguments.

Response 2: A child is not replaceable.

Given the evidence that genetic determinism is false, Murray further stresses that using cloning as a method of replacing a dead child “is unfair. No child should have to bear the oppressive expectation that he or she will live out the life denied to his or her idealized genetic avatar…. Cloning a child to be a reincarnation of someone else is a grotesque, fun-house mirror distortion of parental expectations” (2001). Dan Brock further supports the contention that cloning in order to replace a deceased child is misguided (Brock, 1997). Moreover, because parents have cloned this child with the expressed purpose of replacing a deceased child, the expectations that the new child will be just like the deceased one would be overwhelming and impede the child’s ability to develop her own individuality (Levick, 2004). It should be stressed, however, that this response targets a particular use of cloning (one based on faulty assumptions), not the actual cloning procedure.

d. The Resultant Loss of Therapeutic Cloning for Stem Cell Research and Treating Diseases

The Argument.

Although SCNT is used to create embryos for therapeutic cloning, there is no intent to implant them in order to create children. Rather, the intent is to use the cells of the embryo in order to further research that may ultimately lead to treatments or cures for certain afflictions. Therefore, a categorical ban on SCNT affects not just the prospect of reproductive cloning, but also the research that could be done with cloned embryos. At the very least, the argument concludes, SCNT should be allowed for research and therapeutic purposes (Devolder and Savulescu, 2006; American Medical Association, 2003; Maas, 2001). This was the position presented by Senator Arlen Specter in his proposed Senate Bill 2439, called the “Human Cloning Prohibition Act of 2002:  A Bill to Prohibit Human [Reproductive] Cloning While Preserving Important Areas of Medical Research, Including Stem Cell Research.”

Response 1: Therapeutic cloning leads to reproductive cloning.

The first response maintains that, because therapeutic cloning and reproductive cloning both implement SCNT, allowing the procedure to be perfected for therapeutic cloning makes it more likely that it will later be used for reproductive purposes (Rifkin, 2002; Kass, 1998)

Response 2: Embryo experimentation is unethical.

The second response applies not just to therapeutic cloning, but to any type of embryo experimentation. From the time that an ovum is fertilized and syngamy (the fusion of two gametes to form a new and distinct genetic code) has successfully taken place, there exists a subject, the embryo, which is a bearer of dignity, moral status, and moral rights. It is unethical to experiment on an embryo for the same reason it is unethical to experiment on any human being and since embryo experimentation often results in the destruction of the embryo, this equates to murdering the embryo (Deckers, 2007; Oduncu, 2003; Novak, 2001). Typically, those who offer the second response (e.g., the Catholic Church) regard the human embryo as a complete moral subject upon conception (Pope John Paul II, 1995; Pope Paul VI, 1968), and therefore any experiment that harms them or destroys them is morally tantamount to any experiment that would destroy a person.

5. Arguments Against Reproductive Cloning and Responses

a. The Right to an Open Future

The Argument.

According to some ethicists who oppose human cloning, a cloned child’s identity and individuality will be compromised given that she will be “saddled with a genotype that has already lived” (Kass, 1998, 56; see also Annas, 1998 and Kitcher, 1997). Because of the expectations that the cloned child will re-live the life of her genetic predecessor, the child would necessarily be deprived of her right to an open future. Because all children deserve to have a life and a future that is completely open to them in terms of its prospects (Feinberg, 1980), and because being the product of cloning would necessarily deprive the resulting child of these prospects, cloning is seriously immoral. In a sense, this objection maintains that a cloned child would either lack the free will to live her life according to her own desire and goals or that, at the very least, her free will would be severely restricted by her parents or the society that has certain expectations of her given her genetic lineage. The child would be destined to live in the shadows of her genetic predecessor (Holm, 1998).

Response 1: Faulting cloning for the misconceptions of others.

This argument is unsuccessful in illustrating that there is something intrinsically morally wrong with cloning. The subject of this objection is not cloning itself, but rather the erroneous attitude that parents will have in regard to their cloned child. The child’s very desire to be different from her predecessor illustrates that she is not destined to be like her predecessor. Once prospective parents, and society in general, come to understand that cloned children will possess just as much individuality as any other person, it is possible that these fears, and the attempts to control the child’s future, will largely abate (Wachbroit, 1997). Additionally, if the reason people treat cloned children unfavorably is due to their misconceptions about cloning, then the proper response is not to ban cloning at the expense of compromising procreative liberty, but rather work to rectify these prejudices and misconceptions (Burley and Harris, 1999).

Moreover, it is not just parents of cloned children that may be guilty of violating the child’s right to an open future;  many parents are, to varying degrees of severity, already guilty of violating such a right with their naturally created children, and often times those attempts are subject to failure (see Agar, 2004, 106 for such an example). If such parents are not deprived of their opportunity to have children out of concern that they will violate their child’s right to an open future, then we seem hard pressed to find a reason to deprive couples who would turn to cloning for reproductive purposes of a similar opportunity.

Response 2: Assuming genetic determinism (again).

At its core, however, this objection assumes the very controversial thesis that either a person’s genes play an almost fatalistic role in her life decisions, or that individuals in society will assume some robust version of genetic determinism to be true and will treat cloned children according to that assumption. As abovementioned, there is much evidence to suggest that genetic determinism is not true. In their article “Genetic Modification and Genetic Determinism,” David Resnik and Daniel Vorhaus state that, when it comes to genetic modification, “even if a desired trait is successfully expressed it may not actually restrict options for the child… the open future critique paints with a far broader brush, alleging that the act of modification per se impacts the child’s right to an open future. And it is this claim that we reject…” (2006, 9). The same can be said about cloning (Pence, 1998 and 2008; Wachbroit, 1997). Even if a cloned child did display certain behavioral traits belonging to her genetic predecessor, it is unclear whether the similarity in traits entails that a child’s future would be closed off. Moreover, there is much evidence that, usually, the general public rejects genetic determinism (Hopkins, 1998).

There is evidence, however, that some would regard cloning as a method for resuscitating the dead (the grieving father in Murray’s article attests to this, as well as the individuals who are willing to pay thousands of dollars in order to clone a deceased pet). This supports Kass’ claim that many people may expect a cloned child to be like her genetic predecessor. However, this misconception may quickly be rectified simply by observing the unique personality of the cloned child, especially since her experiences and her nurture, removed by at least a generation, will be substantially different than that of her genetic predecessor (Dawkins, 1998; Pence, 1998).

b. The Right to a Unique Genetic Identity

The Argument.

Because cloning entails recreating an existing person’s genetic code (with the exception of the difference in mitochondrial DNA), some argue that cloning would, necessarily, entail a violation of the cloned child’s right to a distinctive genetic identity (European Parliament, 1998). According to this objection, our DNA is what endows each human being with uniqueness and dignity (Callahan, 1993). Because cloning recreates a pre-existing DNA sequence, the cloned child would be denied that uniqueness and, therefore, her dignity would be compromised. This objection appears to be an incarnation of the objection from the Right to an Open Future. Certainly the concerns are similar: that a cloned child would be deprived of her own individual identity because of her genetic origins. However, whereas in the objection from the Right to an Open Future, the cloned child is deprived of individuality based on the perception of others (and, as is developed above, this does not seem to really be an objection to the practice of cloning simpliciter), this objection indicates that there is something inherently individuality-compromising, and therefore dignity-compromising, in recreating an existing genetic code. If this objection is successful, if recreating a pre-existing genetic code is intrinsically morally objectionable, then it would seem to present an objection to the actual cloning process.

Response 1: Genetic duplication and identical multiples.

Callahan argues that there is something intrinsically identity-depriving, and therefore dignity-depriving, in duplicating a genetic code. However, there is much evidence to counter this claim. As abovementioned, CC the cat neither looks nor acts like Rainbow, her genetic predecessor. However, the strongest evidence against this claim is the existence of identical multiples, who are, in essence, clones of nature (Pence, 2004; Gould, 1997). No one claims that identical multiples’ right to a unique genetic identity was compromised simply in virtue of their creation, which calls into question whether such a right exists in the first place (Silver, 1998; Tooley, 1998; Rhodes, 1995). If Callahan’s concerns were accurate, identical multiples would fail to be individuals in their own right, and, consequently, be harmed because of this. However, there is no evidence that identical multiples feel this way, and there does not seem to be anything inherent about sharing a genetic code that compromises individuality (Elliot, 1998). The fact that identical multiples do not seem harmed or deprived of individuality merely by virtue of not possessing a unique genetic code is evidence that Callahan’s concern against cloning in this regard is misguided.

Response 2: Forgetting nurture.

Lastly, proponents of this objection ignore the very important role that nurture has in shaping a person’s identity. A cloned child would be gestated in a different uterine environment. She would be born into either the same family, but with a different dynamic, as her genetic predecessor, or be born into a different family altogether. She would also likely be raised in a much different society (e.g., a child born in 2010 would have vastly different social influences than a child born in the 1960s or 1970s). She would have different friends, attend different schools, play different games, watch different television shows, listen to different music. The generational and historical differences between a clone and her genetic predecessor would undoubtedly go a long way when it comes to shaping the personality of the former (Pence, 1998; Dawkins, 1998; Harris, 1997; Bor, 1997).

What forms or shapes each person’s individual identity is an intricate interaction of genetics and nurture (Ridley, 2003). While being genetically identical to a pre-existing person will most likely result in some similarities, it will certainly not be strong enough to deprive a cloned child of her individuality or dignity.  A cloned child’s future would remain open, and there is no evidence that she is denied something irreplaceably unique by not having a unique genetic code. Moreover, concerns that genetic duplication compromises dignity overemphasize the role that genetics has as the source of human dignity. Human dignity, some philosophers have argued, has its source in virtue of our being persons and autonomous rational beings. Since, presumably, a clone would still be a person and an autonomous rational being, a clone would certainly retain her human dignity (Glannon, 2005; Elliot, 1998).

c. Cloning is Wrong because it is “Playing God” or because it is “Unnatural”

The Argument.

Another common concern is that cloning is morally wrong because it oversteps the boundaries of humans’ role in scientific research and development. These boundaries are set by either God (and therefore cloning is wrong because it is “playing God”) or nature (and therefore cloning is wrong because it is “unnatural”). Any method of procreation that does not implement traditional modes of conception, i.e., not involving the union of sperm and ova, is guilty of one (or both) of these infractions (Goodman, 2008; Tierney, 2007).  Moreover, advocates of this objection caution against removing God from the process of creation altogether, which, it is argued, is what reproductive cloning achieves (Rikfin, 2000).

Response 1: Clarifying the meaning of “playing God.”

Advocates of the “playing God” objection have the onus to define exactly what “playing God” means. One possible definition of “playing God” is that anything that interferes with nature, or the natural progression of life, interferes with God’s plan for humanity, and is therefore morally wrong. But this is too vague; humans constantly interfere with nature in ways that are not morally criticized. Almost all instances of medical advancements in the past 100 years (e.g., vaccines against diseases, respirators, incubators for preterm infants, pacemakers, etc.) interfere with nature in the sense that they prevent otherwise harmful or fatal afflictions from taking their toll on a human body. Would the same advocates of this objection against cloning object to artificial insulin injections to treat diabetes? (Glannon, 2005). To be more extreme, almost everything humans engage in, from wearing clothing, to using phones and computers, to indoor plumbing, all, in some sense, interfere with some aspect of nature.

Perhaps the more charitable understanding is that “playing God” is morally wrong when it comes to cloning because it is a process that artificially creates life, outside of the practice of sexual intercourse (Meilaender, 1997). Adhering to this definition of “playing God”, however, would condemn any form of artificial reproductive technology, as well as cloning, e.g., IVF, artificial insemination, or intrauterine insemination. In addition, anything that thwarts the natural process of conception (i.e., birth control) may also be morally condemned.  In the “Instruction on Respect for Human Life in Its Origin and on the Dignity of Procreation,” the Catholic Church denounces all forms of reproductive technology on the grounds that reproductive creation is strictly God’s domain (Congregation for the Doctrine of the Faith, 1987). However, most people who denounce human cloning on the grounds that it “plays God” do not denounce other forms of artificial reproduction on similar grounds.

Response 2: Knowing God’s will.

Yet another response is that this objection purports to know what God’s will is in regards to technological advancements such as cloning. However, since key religious texts (e.g., The Bible, The Torah, or the Qu’ran) make no mention of such advancements, it is presumably impossible to determine what God would have to say about them. In other words, inferences about God’s will on such matters are tenuous because we have little basis from which to draw these purported moral inferences (Pence, 2008).

Response 3: Biologism Fallacy.

One response to the “unnatural” objection is similar to the first response to the “playing God” objection; most everything humans do, from medicine to modern forms of sanitation, are “unnatural”, and most are not considered morally objectionable as a consequence. A second response is that such an objection commits what philosopher Daniel Maguire calls the “Biologism Fallacy”: “the fallacious effort to wring a moral mandate out of raw biological facts” (1983, 148). In other words, “unnatural” is not synonymous with “immoral” (and conversely, “natural” is not synonymous with “moral”). While it is true that cloning (along with other types of reproductive technologies) is not the “natural” way of conceiving a child, this alone does not render cloning immoral.

d. The Dangers of Cloning

The Argument.

Many philosophers and ethicists who would otherwise support reproductive cloning concede that concern for the safety of children born via cloning is reason to caution against its use (Harris, 2004; Glannon, 2005).  The claim is that a cloned child would be in danger of suffering from severe genetic defects as a result of being a clone, or that cloning would result in a high number of severely defective embryos before one healthy human embryo is developed. Ian Wilmut, Dolly’s creator, has denounced human reproductive cloning as too dangerous to attempt (Travis, 2001). According to Wilmut, “Dolly was derived from 277 embryos, so the other 276 didn’t make it. The previous year’s work, which led to the birth and survival of Megan and Morag, used more than 200 embryos. We have success rates of roughly one in a hundred or less” (Klotzko, 1998, 134). Even if a clone were to appear healthy at birth, there are concerns about health problems arising later in life. For example, while there is no evidence that Dolly’s respiratory issues were due to her being a clone, questions remain whether her arthritis, which is uncommon among sheep her age, could have resulted because of the nature of her genesis (Williams, 2003). Even attempting to perfect human reproductive cloning would entail a trial and error approach that would lead to the destruction of many embryos, and may produce severely disabled children before a healthy one is born.

Response 1: The nonidentity problem.

One response typically given by philosophers when concerning the ethics of preconception decisions that may lead to the birth of a disabled child involves an appeal to Derek Parfit’s nonidentity problem (Parfit, 1984, though Parfit himself does not apply this to cloning). Applied to preconception choices, Parfit’s argument can be applied as follows. Suppose I desire to get pregnant, but am currently suffering from a physical ailment that would result in conceiving and birthing an infant with developmental impairments. Yet, if I were to wait two months, my ailment would pass and I would conceive a perfectly healthy baby. Most people would agree that I should wait those two months; and, indeed, if I do not wait, many people would say that I acted wrongly. The resulting child, moreover, would most likely be identified as the victim of my actions. This intuitive response, however, is surprisingly tricky to defend.  If harm is defined as making someone worse off than she otherwise would have been, it is difficult to maintain that I harmed the resulting child by my actions, even if she were impaired. For the child that would have been born two months later would not have been the same child that is born if I do not wait; the impaired child would never have existed had I waited those two months. Unless the child’s life is so bad that her nonexistence would be preferable, I did not make the child worse off by conceiving her and giving birth to her with those impairments, and thus I did not harm her. Because I did not harm her, I did not do anything morally wrong in this circumstance. The argument can best be standardized as follows:

1. I have only harmed an individual if I had made her worse off than she otherwise would have been had it not been for my actions.

2. Only if I have harmed someone can my action be deemed morally wrong.

3. A child born with mental, physical, or developmental impairments usually does not have a life that is so bad that it renders nonexistence preferable.

4. Therefore, a child born with mental, physical or developmental impairments is not made worse off by being brought into existence.

5. Therefore, deliberate conception, gestation, and birthing of a child with mental, physical, or developmental impairments does not, usually, harm the child (unless the impairments are so bad that they make the child’s life worse than not having existed at all).

6. Therefore, I have (usually) done nothing morally wrong by deliberately bringing into existence a child who suffers from mental, physical, or developmental impairments.

Using the nonidentity problem in the context of the reproductive cloning debate yields the following result: The alternative to being born a clone is not to be born at all. Unless the cloned child’s life is made so horrible by her disabilities that it would have been better that she not been born at all, she was not harmed by being brought into existence via cloning, even if she is born with genetic defects as a result. As long as the cloned child has a life that, despite her genetic defect, is still worth living, then it would still be permissible to use cloning to bring her into being (Lane, 2006).

It is important to note, however, that the nonidentity problem is controversial, and that not all philosophers and ethicists agree with its conclusion (Weinberg, 2008; Cohen, 1996). Indeed, many argue that it would be morally impermissible to bring a child into the world who suffers, even if the child’s life has a net value that renders it worth living (Steinbock and McClamrock, 1994).

Response 2: The dangers of natural reproduction.

Natural reproduction can itself produce dangerous results. Women dispose of fertilized eggs during their menstrual cycle more often than they are aware; one study claims that as many as 73% of fertilized eggs do not survive to 6 weeks gestation (Boklage, 1990). From the ones that do implant, approximately 2% to 3% of newborn infants suffer from congenital abnormities of varying degrees of severity (Kumar et al., 2004). If safety concerns about cloning are severe enough to ban its practice, this can only be justified if cloning were more risky (that is, resulted in the birth of more children with more severe abnormalities) than natural reproduction. Some couples choose to reproduce in full knowledge that one or both of them harbor genetic disorders that may be passed along to their offspring, and some of these are rather severe, such as Huntington’s disease. Yet these parents are not prohibited from procreating because of this. Therefore, if parents are not prohibited from procreating on the grounds that they may pass along a severe genetic defect to their children, then it is difficult to deny a set of parents who can only rely on cloning for procreation the chance to do so based on safety reasons alone (unless the abnormalities that may result from cloning are more severe than the abnormalities that may result from natural conception) (Brock, 1997). Similarly, objecting to cloning on the grounds that embryos are sacrificed in order to achieve a live birth is only a valid objection if the number of embryos lost are greater in cloning than in natural reproduction.

Finally, even if safety concerns are sufficient to warrant a current ban on human reproductive cloning, such concerns would be temporary, and would abate as cloning becomes safer. Indeed, safety concerns led the National Bioethics Advisory Commission (1997) to recommend a temporary, rather than permanent, moratorium on human reproductive cloning.

e. Cloning Entails the Creation of Designer Children, or it Turns Children into Commodities

The Argument.

If we engage in cloning, this objection goes, we run the risk of inserting our will too much into our procreative decisions; we would get to choose not just to have a child, but what kind of child to have. In doing so, we run the risk of relegating children to the status of mere possessions or commodities, rather than regarding them as beings with their own intrinsic worth (Harakas, 1998; Kass, 1998; Meilaender, 1997).  When a couple engages in sexual intercourse and produces a baby, the child is an “offspring of a man and woman, but a replication of neither; their offspring but not their product whose meaning and destiny they might determine” (Meilaender, 1997, 42). Because cloning involves the artificial process of recreating a pre-existing genetic code, prospective parents could, first, choose their child’s DNA (thereby creating a “designer child”), and, second, because they are creating a “replica” of an existing person, they will consider the child more akin to property than an individual in her own right. These factors will contribute to viewing and treating the child as a mere commodity. The more “artificial” conception becomes, the more the resulting children will be seen as the possessions of the parents, rather than as persons in their own right. Rev. Stanley Harakas puts this point as follows: “Cloning would deliberately deny by design the cloned human being a set of loving and caring parents. The cloned human being would not be the product of love, but of scientific procedures. Rather than being considered persons, the likelihood is that these cloned human beings would be considered ‘objects’ to be used” (1998, 89).

Although he rejects the contention that clones would not be considered persons, Thomas Shannon expresses concerns that the increasing artificiality of conception, not just via the use of cloning, but via the use of all forms of artificial reproductive technologies, will “transform our thinking about ourselves, and the transformation will be in a mechanistic direction” (Shannon and Walter, 2003, 134). That is, the move away from natural conception towards artificial conception will lead to humans collectively regarding themselves as more machine-like rather than as organic beings.

Response 1: Cloning is not genetic modification.

Cloning does not necessarily entail the creation of “designer” children because cloning recreates a pre-existing DNA; it does not involve modifying or enhancing DNA in order to produce a child with certain desired traits. Cloning is not to be equated with genetic modification or enhancement (Wachbroit, 1997; Strong, 1998).

Response 2: Natural vs. artificial conception.

Advocates of the objection that cloning results in the transformation of procreation into manufacture seem to assume that, whereas we do not consider children that arise from natural reproduction as ours to do what we wish with, we would if they arise from artificial conception. That is, the tacit premise is that there is some trait inherent in artificial (i.e., non-sexual) conception that necessitates parents regarding their children as mere objects, and this trait is not found in “natural” conception. Yet, we can look towards the children who are products of modern day artificial reproduction in order to see that such a concern is not supported by the evidence. There are many children who are products of artificial reproductive technologies (IVF, intrauterine insemination, gender selection, and gamete intrafallopian transfer, among others) and there does not seem to be an increase of despotic control over these children on behalf of their parents. One study found that children born from IVF and DI (donor insemination) are faring as well as children born via natural conception. More importantly, given Meilaender’s concern that the quality of parenting is compromised in tandem with the artificiality of conception, the study found that “the quality of parenting in families with a child conceived by assisted conception is superior to that shown by families with a naturally conceived child, even when gamete donation is used in the child’s conception” (Golombok et al., 1995, 295; also see Golombok, 2003 and Golombok et al., 2001).

Meilaender may respond that, in these cases, the children are still a product of a unification of sperm and ovum, whereas this is not the case with cloning. However, it is unclear why generating a child via somatic cells is more likely to foster despotism than when the child is generated using germ cells. Some have argued that, on the contrary, a cloned child would feel even closer to the parent from whom she was cloned, given that they would share all their genetic information, rather than just half (Pence, 2008). Moreover, the findings of the study supported the thesis that “genetic ties are less important for family functioning than a strong desire for parenthood” (Golombok et al., 1995, 296), which suggests that the parents of cloned children would not be as caught up with the genetic origins of their offspring, and so their parenting would not be as affected by it, as Meilaender contends. According to the study, the quality of parenting increased in tandem with the amount of effort it took to achieve parenthood. It could be argued, therefore, that the quality of parenting for cloned children would be just as good, if not superior, to that of naturally conceived children.

Response 3: Clones would not be loveless creations.

Harakas claims that cloned children will be deprived of loving parents because their genesis will be one of science, rather than love. The studies conducted by Golombok certainly seem to provide evidence to the contrary. Intentionally taking steps to create a child via cloning (or any other kind of reproductive technology) could be seen, instead, as a mutual affirmation of love on behalf of the prospective parents and clear evidence that they really desired the resulting child. Whereas in sexual reproduction the child may be a product of chance, a cloned child would be a product of deliberate choice, which, according to some philosophers, could be a superior method of creation in some respects (Buchanan et al. 2000). Creating a child via cloning does not entail that there is a lack of mutual love between the parents, or that the resulting child would be any less loved (Strong, 1998). Genesis via sexual reproduction is neither a necessary nor a sufficient condition for being born to a set of loving parents and in a nurturing environment.

f. Cloning and the Ambiguity of Familial Roles

The Argument.

Genetically speaking, a cloned child would be her genetic predecessor’s identical twin sibling. If the child is cloned with the intent to serve as the social child of her genetic predecessor, she would be, genetically, her social mother’s twin sister (or his social father’s twin brother), and her social grandparents’ genetic daughter. The concern is that such a radical alteration of familial relationships would be detrimental to the cloned child (Kass, 1998; O’Neil, 2002). As Paul Ramsey puts it: “To mix the parental and the twin relation might well be psychologically disastrous for the young” (Ramsey, 1970). Wide-spread cloning would exacerbate the problem by distorting generational boundaries, which would add a layer of confusion to society’s conception of the nature of the family, and the roles of its individual members (Kass, 1998).

Response 1: No such confusion is likely to arise.

There are two responses to this response. First, doubts can be cast as to whether this confusion would really ensue. Second, even if such confusion did result, it is questionable whether it would be any more detrimental to the child than any confusion that currently exists about parental roles given certain reproductive technologies. For example, it is physically possible for a child to have as many as six distinct “parents”: three genetic parents (the mitochondrial DNA donor, the somatic cell donor used to re-nucleate an enucleated ovum, and the sperm donor), one gestational parent, and two (perhaps even more) social parents. If a cloned child would not experience any less confusion than a child in such a situation, then we would be hard pressed to show why the prospective parents of the former ought to be denied the opportunity to have a genetically related child based on these grounds alone (Harris, 2004). Moreover, doubts can be cast as to whether the ambiguity of genetic lineage caused by the cloning relationship will really result in the consequences Kass and O’Neil are fretting. A social father, for example, is not likely to suddenly rescind his responsibilities toward his daughter because the child is, genetically, his wife’s twin sister (Wachbroit, 1997). Finally, as is evident from children raised by adoptive parents, social parents usually retain the honorific role as the child’s “real” parents, even though there are no genetic ties between them and the adopted child. In other words, what defines a parent seems to have less to do with genetics and more to do with who performs the social role of mother and father (Purdy, 2005).

Response 2: Such confusion would not warrant a prohibition on cloning.

Even if there were such confusion, however, would it be so detrimental as to warrant banning reproductive cloning altogether? Moreover, even if there were a detriment, it is unclear whether that would be a result of society’s prejudice and fear of human cloning, or a result that inherently comes with being a clone. Finally, it would have to be clear that being the genetic twin to a social parent is so detrimental that it would warrant interfering with the prospective parents’ reproductive liberty. Indeed, for any purported harm that may come from cloning (whether physical, psychological, or emotional), it must be argued why those harms are sufficient for banning reproductive cloning if comparable harm would not be sufficient for banning any other kind of reproductive method, whether natural or artificial (Harris, 2004; Robertson, 2006).

6. References and Further Reading

  • Agar, Nicholas (2004), Liberal Eugenics: A Defence of Human Enhancement. Malden: Blackwell.
  • Allison, Lizabeth (2007), Fundamental Molecular Biology, chapter 8: “Recombinant DNA Technology and Molecular Cloning.” Malden: Blackwell, pp. 180-231.
  • Annas, George et  al. (1996), “The Politics of Human-Embryo Research – Avoiding Ethical Gridlock.” New England Journal of Medicine, 334.20: 293-340.
  • Annas, George (1998), “The Prospect of Human Cloning: An Opportunity for National and International Cooperation” in Human Cloning: Biomedical Ethical Review. James Humber and  Robert Almeder (eds). Totawa: Humana Press, pp. 53-63.
  • Boiani, Michele and Hans Schöler (2002), “Determinants of Pluripotency in Mammals” in Principles of Cloning. Jose Cibelli, Robert Lanza, Keith Campbell, Michael D. West (eds.) New  York: Academic Press, pp. 109-152.
  • Boklage, Charles (1990), “Survival Probability of Human Conceptions from Fertilization to Term.” International Journal of Fertility, 35.2:75-94.
  • Bor, Jonathan, “Cloning Adds a Dimension to Nature-Nurture Debate: Identical Humans are Not in the Cards.” The Baltimore Sun, March 9, 1997.
  • Boyle, Robert and Julian Savulescu (2001) “Ethics of Using Preimplantation Genetic Diagnosis to Select a Stem Cell Donor for an Existing Person.”  BMJ 323:1240-1243.
  • Brannigan, Michael (ed.) (2001), Ethical Issues in Human Cloning. New York, NY: Seven Bridges Press.
  • Brock, Dan (1997), “Cloning Human Beings: An Assessment of the Ethical Issues Pro and Con,” in Cloning Human Beings Volume II: Commissioned Papers. Rockville, MD: National Bioethics Advisory Commission.
  • Buchanan, Allen et al. (2002), From Chance to Choice: Genetics and Justice. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Burely, Justin and John Harris (1999), “Human Cloning and Child Welfare.” Journal of Medical Ethics, 25.2:108-113.
  • Callahan, Daniel (1993), “Perspective on Cloning: A Threat to Individual Uniqueness; an Attempt to Aid Childless Couples by Engineered Conceptions Could Transform the Idea of Human Identity” in Los Angeles Times, Nov. 12, 1993.
  • Cohen, Cynthia (1996), “’Give Me Children or I’ll Shall Die!’: New Reproductive Technologies and Harm to Children.” Hastings Center Report, 26.2: 19-27.
  • Courtwright, Andrew M. and Wechsler Doron (2007), “Is Restricting Access to Assisted Reproductive Technology an Infringement of Reproductive Rights?”  American Medical Association Journal of Ethics, 9.9:  635-640.
  • Dawkins, Richard (1998), “What Wrong with Cloning?” in Clones and Cloning: Facts and Fantasies About Human Cloning. Martha Nussbaum and Cass Sunstein (eds). New York: Norton and Company Inc, pp. 54-66.
  • Deckers, Jan (2007), “Are Those Who Subscribe to the View that Early Embryos are Persons Irrational and Inconsistent?: A Reply to Brock.” Journal of Medical Ethics, 33.2: 102-106.
  • Devolder, Katrien and Julian Savulescu (2006), “The Moral Imperative to Conduct Cloning and Stem Cell Research.” Cambridge Quarterly of Healthcare Ethics, 15.1: 7-21.
  • Doetschman, R.G. et al. (1987), “Targeted Correction of a Mutant HPRT Gene in Mouse Embryonic Stem Cells.” Nature, 330: 576–578
  • Dworkin, Ronald. Life’s Dominion: An Argument About Abortion. Euthanasia, and Individual Freedom. New York: Vintage Press.
  • Elliot, David (1998), “Uniqueness, Individuality, and Human Cloning,” Journal of Applied Philosophy 15.3: 217-230.
  • Ethics Committee of the American Fertility Society (1985), “The Constitutional Aspects of Procreative Liberty” in Ethical Issues in the New Reproductive Technologies. Richard T. Hull (ed.)Belmont: Wadsworth Publishing Company, pp. 8-15.
  • Feinberg, Joel (1980), “A Child’s Right to an Open Future” in Philosophy of Education: An Anthology. Randall Curren (ed.) Malden: Blackwell, pp. 112-123.
  • Freed. Curt. R. et al. April 21, 1999. “Double-Blind Controlled Trial of Human Embryonic Dopamine Cell Transplants in Advanced Parkinson’s Disease: Study, Design, Surgical Strategy, Patient Demographics, and Pathological Outcome” (presented to the American Academy of Neurology).
  • French, Andrew J. et al. (2008), “Development of Human Cloned Blastocysts Following Somatic Cell Nuclear Transfer with Adult Fibroblasts.” Stem Cells 26.2: 485-493.
  • Gearhart, John D (1998), “New Potential for Human Embryonic Stem Cells,” Science 282: 1061.
  • Glannon, Walter (2005), Biomedical Ethics. New  York: Oxford University Press.
  • Golombok, Susan et al. (1995), “Families Created by the New Reproductive Technologies: Quality of Parenting and Social and Emotional Development of the Children.” Child Development, 66.2: 285-298.
  • Golombok, Susan (2001), “The “Test-Tube” Generation: Parent-Child Relationships and the Psychological Well-Being of In Vitro Fertilization Children at Adolescence.” Child Development, 72.2: 599-608.
  • Golombok, Susan (2003), “ Reproductive Technology and Its Impact on Child Psychosocial and Emotional Development” in: Tremblay RE, Barr RG, Peters RDeV (eds). Encyclopedia on Early Childhood Development [online]. Montreal, Quebec: Centre of Excellence for Early Childhood Development; 2003:1-7.
  • Goodman, Jim. “Cloning Animals is Unnatural, Unethical.” The Capital Times, January 25, 2008.
  • Gould, Stephen Jay (1997), “Individuality: Cloning and Discomfiting Cases of Siamese Twins.” The Sciences 37: 14-16.
  • Harakas, Stanley (1998), “To Clone or Not to Clone?” in Ethical Issues in Human Cloning. Edited by Michael C. Brannigan. New York, NY: Seven Bridges Press, pp. 89-90.
  • Harris, John (1997), “Good-bye, Dolly?: The Ethics of Human Cloning.” Journal of Medical Ethics, 23.6: 353-360)
  • Harris, John (2004), On Cloning. New York: Routledge.
  • Häyry, Matti (2003), “Philosophical Arguments For and Against Human Cloning.” Bioethics, 17.5-6: 447-459.
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Author Information

Bertha Alvarez Manninen
Email: bertha.manninen@asu.edu
Arizona State University at the West Campus
U. S. A.

Last updated: December 8, 2010 | Originally published: