Catharine Trotter Cockburn (1679?—1749)

Catharine Trotter Cockburn was an active contributor to early modern philosophical discourse in England, especially regarding morality. Her philosophical production was primarily in defense of John Locke and Samuel Clarke. Nevertheless, her thinking was original and independent in many respects.

Cockburn’s moral philosophy combines elements of Locke's epistemology with Clarke’s fitness theory, and its central axiom is that the true ground of morality consists in human nature. She argued that since all human beings are naturally provided with reason, moral obligation rests on the conformity of God’s command to our own reason. According to her anti-voluntarist moral view, the will of God does not lay the foundations of morality, but it gives morality the force of a law. Furthermore, Cockburn maintained that Man is naturally inclined towards sociability and is consequently morally obliged to contribute to the good and preservation of society. This is one of the most distinctive of Cockburn’s ideas, which departs from a strictly Lockean moral view.

Cockburn entertained a universal and anti-dogmatic idea of the Christian religion founded on the essentials of human nature being reason and sociability. In her view, since there is not an absolutely perfect communion, everyone can choose the one she or he judges as the best. Churches should not waste time presuming to be infallible; rather, they should aim at satisfying their adherents by teaching those truths necessary for salvation. Thus, she converted to the Church of England from Catholicism.

Although mainly focused on morality, Cockburn also dealt with some metaphysical issues that often connect to it, particularly the nature of the soul and the reality of space. Regarding the former, she inquired whether the soul is material or spiritual, concluding that although it is probably immaterial, there is no evidence against either its immateriality or the possibility of its being thinking matter. Moreover, while she defended Locke’s position that only consciousness makes personal identity, Cockburn also gave an original mode-based interpretation of Locke’s view on personhood. As regards the reality of space, she rejected Edmund Law’s position against Clarke that space is only an abstract idea. On the contrary, she argued that space is a real being that can fill up the abyss between body and spirit since it partakes of the nature of both.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Moral Philosophy
    1. The True Grounds of Morality
    2. Moral Obligation
  3. Religion
  4. Metaphysical Issues
    1. The Nature of the Soul
    2. The Reality of Space
  5. Originality
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Catharine Trotter was born in London probably on August 16, 1679. This is the date provided by Thomas Birch (1705-1766), her official biographer and the editor of the collection of her posthumous Works (1751). However, her birthdate has been recently questioned by Anne Kelley, who found an entry of baptism for “Katherine Trotters, daughter of David Trotters, gentleman, and his wife Sarah” for August 29, 1674, in the Register of St Andrew, Holborn (Kelley 2002, 1). Catharine was the younger daughter of Captain David Trotter, commodore in the Royal Navy, and Mrs. Sarah Ballenden. According to the inscription on Catharine’s gravestone in the cemetery of Longhorsley, she died on May 11, 1749, “in the 70th year of her age.” This seems to confirm the date proposed by Birch as her most probable birthdate.

After her father’s death in 1683, King Charles II granted a pension to her family that was barely sufficient for survival. Little is known of Catharine Trotter’s life until 1701. Birch tells that as a child, she taught herself French and received help in learning Latin, grammar, and logic. At the age of sixteen, she started her career as a playwright. From 1695 to 1706, she wrote and published five plays: Agnes de Castro (1695), The Fatal Friendship (1698), Love at a Loss (1700), The Unhappy Penitent (1701), and The Revolution of Sweden (1706), which were well received and repeatedly performed.

Between 1701 and 1703, her family moved to Salisbury, where Catharine found the favor of Elizabeth Burnet, the wife of the bishop Gilbert Burnet. There, she devoted herself to studying John Locke’s philosophy. In 1702 she anonymously published her first philosophical work, the Defence of Mr. Locke’s Essay of Human Understanding, written in response to the three anonymous Remarks upon an Essay Concerning Humane Understanding, published in London between 1697 and 1699, which had been challenging John Locke’s epistemology and moral philosophy. The worth of her Defence was recognized by prominent philosophers of the time, including John Toland, Gottfried W. Leibniz, and John Locke himself. Locke was so impressed by “the strength and clearness” of Cockburn’s reasoning that once he came to know the authorship of the Defence, he sent her a sincere letter of appreciation and a number of books as gifts.

In 1707 she converted to Anglicanism from the Church of Rome, and, on that occasion she published A Discourse Concerning a Guide in Controversies, in Two Letters: Written to One of the Church of Rome, by a Person Lately Converted from that Communion, explaining the main reasons for her choice. One year later Catharine married Patrick Cockburn, a clergyman, and they had three daughters: Mary, Catherine, and Grissel; and a son, John. From 1714 to 1726, their family experienced serious financial difficulties because of Patrick’s refusal to take the oath of abjuration against the pretender James Stuart. In this period Catharine devoted herself to her family and was totally diverted from her studies in philosophy. After Patrick eventually took the oath in 1726, he was appointed to the episcopal congregation of Aberdeen and their family’s condition rapidly improved. She then had the opportunity to pursue her intellectual interests, and later that same year, she wrote A Vindication of Mr. Locke’s Christian Principles, from the Injurious Imputations of Dr. Holdsworth. However, this essay remained unpublished until its inclusion in the 1751 edition of her Works.

In 1737, the Cockburns moved to Longhorsley, the last destination of Patrick’s career, and here they spent the final part of their lives. This was the most intense and prolific period of Catharine Cockburn’s life as a philosopher.

In 1739 she wrote her Remarks upon Some Writers in the Controversy Concerning the Foundation of Moral Duty and Moral Obligation, which was published in The History of the Works of the Learned in 1743. In 1747 she also published The Principles and Reasonings of Dr. Rutherforth’s Essay on the Nature and Obligation of Virtue, criticizing Thomas Rutherforth’s moral philosophy. Both works were written in defence of Samuel Clarke.

Catharine Cockburn also discussed her philosophical and religious positions in her correspondence with several people, especially Thomas Burnet of Kemnay; her son, John; her niece, Anne Arbuthnot; Thomas Sharp; and Edmund Law.

She was aware of the bias against women’s intellectual skills, and she lucidly resolved to publish all her philosophical writings anonymously for the sake of truth only. As she explained to Thomas Burnet of Kemnay, “a woman’s name would give a prejudice against a work of this nature; and truth and reason have less force, when the person, who defends them, is prejudged against” (Cockburn 1751, II: 155). Interestingly, towards the end of her life, Cockburn entrusted Thomas Birch with publishing a two-volume collection of her works. By that time she probably felt ready to stop hiding. She died in May 1749, only a few weeks after her husband’s death, and her Works was published posthumously in 1751.

2. Moral Philosophy

a. The True Grounds of Morality

Due to the style and structure of her philosophical writings, Catharine Cockburn’s thought is not presented systematically. In fact, since all her works were written in defence of someone else (either John Locke or Samuel Clarke), she was compelled to follow the reasoning of her adversaries. While she addressed a number of philosophical issues, such as the nature and the immortality of the soul, thinking matter, the nature of substances, and the origin of evil, giving original and sophisticated contributions on such subjects, moral philosophy was still her primary concern.

Cockburn’s views on morality, which take form throughout her works, is a combination of Locke’s principles of knowledge and Clarke’s moral fitness theory, and also includes elements from Cambridge Platonism and moral sense theory. She entertains an anthropocentric view on morality, defending the idea that human beings are naturally rational and social creatures. Accordingly, she argues that the true ground of morality is to be found in neither eternal moral truths nor in God’s command but consists in human nature itself.

In the first of her philosophical works, the Defence of Mr. Locke’s Essay (1702), Cockburn replies to support John Locke against Remarks upon an Essay Concerning Humane Understanding, probably written by Thomas Burnet (1635-1715) between 1697 and 1699—although Burnet’s authorship has been recently questioned (Walmsley, Craig, and Burrows 2016). She summarizes the Remarker’s objections in three main points: the doctrine of natural conscience, which he opposes to Locke’s anti-innatism; his accusation of voluntarism against Locke; and his worries about the possibility of a material soul and thinking matter.

Adhering to Locke’s epistemology, Cockburn argues that we cannot have any idea not derived from sensation and reflection, and as a consequence we can find the true grounds of morality by following Locke’s principles of knowledge. As such, she believes that good and evil are not absolute principles imprinted in our minds by God from the beginning; instead, they are ideas formed in us by pleasure and pain. Contrary to this idea, the Remarker denies that Locke’s epistemology could provide “a sure foundation for morality” (Burnet (?) 1697a, 4) and instead holds that human beings are endowed with a “natural conscience.” This is a “natural sagacity” or an “instinct” which operates within us as “a principle of action” and directs our behaviour prior to reason (Burnet (?) 1699, 7-8). Rebuffing the Remarker’s objections, Catharine Cockburn maintains that no morality is possible independently of ratiocination since moral virtues such as justice, fidelity, and gratitude would be empty notions if taken with no relation to human beings. She points out that although Locke refused metaphysical or moral truths originally imprinted in mind, he never denied the existence of a power of perceiving in the soul and distinguishing between good and evil. Simply, she argues that even if this power is so immediate that it seems to prevent any ratiocination, it is actually an effect of ratiocination itself. This power in the soul is what Cockburn calls “conscience,” which does not consist in an inward moral sense as argued by the author of the Remarks, but instead comes from sensation and reflection and is set to work through man’s first persuasions and confirmed by his habits. Conscience can be very useful in morality when one is rightly educated, but it can also be misleading when corrupted by vicious customs. Thus, Cockburn concludes that conscience, far from proving innate moral principles, must neither be taken for a moral law nor for the true foundation of morality.

Furthermore, in Cockburn’s moral philosophy, the grounds of morality do not rest in the original and absolute moral principles in God’s mind. More precisely, she does not deny the reality of such principles but instead argues that the perfect being and its moral attributes of goodness and justice are infinitely beyond our narrow capacities. Human beings can have an idea of God and his attributes only by reflecting upon themselves: “for whatever is the original standard of good and evil, it is plain, we have no notion of them but by their conformity, or repugnancy to our reason, and with relation to our nature” (I: 57-58). Interestingly, according to Cockburn we first have a notion of good, and then we know that God himself is good. Therefore, the nature of God neither provides sure foundation for morality, nor can be the rule of good and evil.

Instead, Cockburn adopts an anthropocentric view according to which the nature of man and the good of society are to us the reason and rule of moral good and evil. Rejecting the Remarker’s accusation of moral relativism against Locke’s anti-innatism, she particularly emphasizes that since reason and sociability are essential to human nature, they are the true and immutable grounds of morality. In fact, God has fitted everything to its proper end—which is happiness for Mankind—and accordingly he requires those things of us to which he has suited our nature. On this point, Cockburn explicitly refers to Grotius’ view that the law of nature is the product of human nature itself and hence she draws the conclusion that “it must subsist as long as human nature” (I: 58). In other words, as long as human beings are human beings, they can infallibly know the difference between good and evil by the light of reason and accordingly they can act suitably to their sociable nature. It is worth noting that Cockburn deliberately refrains from engaging a metaphysical controversy with the Remarker on morality—and indeed, this is not the main concern of her Defence. She rather aims at finding the epistemological and ontological foundation of morality from a human perspective. As we will see below, her later works show a stronger commitment to metaphysical and theological aspects of morality.

The anonymous Remarker also charges Locke with voluntarism. Obviously he does not use this term, which was coined only in the nineteenth century to define a moral theory according to which will takes priority over intellect, and as applied to divine action, holds that morality originates from the will of God. Historically, this view was attributed to Augustine of Hippo, Duns Scotus, William of Ockham, and in the early modern age, to Thomas Hobbes and Robert Boyle. The opposite approach is usually called “intellectualism,” which states that intellect takes precedence over will, and moral standards eternally exist in God’s intellect, determining his will and command. This view is usually ascribed to Thomas Aquinas in the Middle Ages and Cambridge Platonists in the seventeenth century.

The Remarker accuses Locke of grounding morality in the arbitrary will of God, enforcing it by a system of rewards and punishments. From the Remarker’s point of view, this supposition has dangerous consequences for morality: he points out that if the will of God were the original rule of good and evil, without any rule determining his will, there would not be any rule of sin to God either, and God himself would be “the author of sin” (Burnet (?) 1697b, 22).

Rejecting this accusation, Cockburn explains that Locke’s notions of “will of God” and “punishments and rewards” could give morality the force of law but were not meant to be its true foundation. This is a central point in her moral philosophy, which clarifies the role of God’s will and command and at the same time reaffirms the importance of human reason in morality. She maintains that, as with the case of good and evil, “we can only know the will of God by its conformity to our nature” (I: 62), and therefore his command would not have any effectiveness if it were not “knowable to us by the light of nature” (I: 61). However, in her first philosophical work, Cockburn does not provide further details concerning moral obligation, limiting herself to the claim that God’s command is not the source of obligation and that human beings are obliged to do what he commands by their own reason. She further develops her notion of moral obligation in her mature works, especially in the Remarks upon Some Writers (1743) and in the Remarks upon the Principles and Reasonings of Dr. Rutherforth’s Essay (1747).

b. Moral Obligation

Like her Defence of Locke, Cockburn’s later philosophical works pursue an apologetic purpose: to defend Samuel Clarke from the attacks of a number of critics. Nevertheless, these writings show her evident intellectual autonomy. She was particularly inspired by Clarke’s doctrine of moral fitness, according to which an agreement or disagreement of some things with others necessarily arises from different relations among different things. Clarke argued that there is an eternal universal fitness of things that precedes and determines both the will of God and the will of his creatures. In fact, since God is self-existent, absolutely independent, and all-powerful, he always does what he knows to be fittest to be done, and he therefore acts always according to the strictest rules of infinite goodness, justice, truth, and all other moral perfections. Thus, according to Clarke, virtue consists in the conformity of actions to the fitness of things.

Although Cockburn advocated Clarke’s view on fitness, there are strong clues that she was not directly influenced by it. In fact, before Samuel Clarke introduced his fitness doctrine in the Boyle Lectures he gave in 1705, Cockburn had developed her own view by the time she wrote her Defence (1701/02): despite the difference in terminology, what is “suitable to human nature” for Cockburn seems to correspond to what is “fit” for Clarke (Bolton 1993, 575-586; Sheridan 2007, 147-148).

Cockburn’s Remarks upon Some Writers was mainly influenced by Edmund Law’s 1731 English translation of De Origine Mali by William King (1702). In commenting on Leibniz’s theory of the best of all possible worlds, Cockburn explains that God is perfectly free to choose which world to bring into actual existence, but although the creation of a particular system proceeds solely from a determination of the will of God, the relations and fitness of things in it are necessary, and his will must itself conform to that fitness. She entertains a partially intellectualist moral view, according to which God’s intellect seems to have a priority over his will, insofar as he perceives the eternity and inalterability of the necessary relations of all possible things. This is the reason why God could never want pain as suitable and pleasure as unsuitable for sensible beings, for it would be contrary to the system of relations of this world in which every living being aims at happiness.

In response to an accusation of inconsistency between this doctrine and the Lockean epistemological foundation of morality Cockburn presented in her Defence, a lengthy footnote was added to the 1751 edition of her Defence. The critic is unidentified, and it is still unclear whether the responding note was written by Cockburn herself or by Birch, especially because it refers to the author in the third person. However, it has been convincingly shown that it is quite faithful to Cockburn’s view (Bolton 1993, 570). In this footnote she explains that although the grounds of moral obligation have not been discussed in the Defence, she nonetheless explicitly rejects “the notion of founding morality on arbitrary will” and implicitly supposes “the nature of God, or the divine understanding, and the nature of man […] to be the true grounds of it” (I: 61). Interestingly, Cockburn here distinguishes between “real laws,” which “imply authority and sanctions,” and “the law of nature,” which “obliges us, not as dependent, but as reasonable beings” (I: 61). God himself, the Supreme Rational Being, “who is subject to no laws, and accountable to none,” is obliged to do always what is right and fit (I:, 61-62). She reaffirms that God’s command and will, and rewards and punishment, are necessary to morality as they “only give it the force of a law,” but they are not the source of obligation (I: 61-62).

Cockburn’s view on obligation has been recently seen as a mark of her independence and originality. In fact, it seems to be something different from Locke’s view that moral obligation is grounded in a superior decree (Sheridan 2007, 145-46). However, it is worth noting that Locke mainly expressed this position in his Essays on the Laws of Nature, which remained unpublished until 1954, and it is unlikely that Cockburn read it. Nevertheless, her position undoubtedly differs from Locke’s.

In her Remarks upon Some Writers, Cockburn claims that all human beings have a moral sense, which operates in them before any sort of revelation. However, she explains that this moral sense, contrary to the thought of Scottish Enlightenment thinker Frances Hutcheson (1694-1746), is not an innate, blind instinct, but “a consciousness consequent upon the perceptions of the rational mind” (I: 407), and it can be cultivated and improved by the right use of our abilities. Although she allows that the faculty that distinguishes between right and wrong is probably innate “since it operates in some measure on all mankind” (I: 407), its exercise depends on custom and education. Such a moral sense also acknowledges that virtue consists in the law of human nature, and it accordingly approves virtuous actions and disapproves the contrary. Thus, the obligation that human moral sense perceives as a duty arises from the eternal fitness of things and does not depend on the will of God and the sanctions of his laws, but can only be enforced by them. In fact, Cockburn argues that since mankind is a system of creatures that continually need one another’s assistance, it is necessary that everyone contributes to the good and preservation of society according to her/his capacity. To this purpose, human beings are so far pushed towards virtue by their moral sense that all of them naturally feel the moral “obligation of living suitably to a rational and social nature” (I: 413). For Cockburn, it is plain that as a rational being should act suitably to reason and the nature of things, so a social being should promote the good of others: these ends are suitable to the nature of rational and social beings, and the contrary would be as absurd as preferring pain to pleasure.

Cockburn further explains this point in her Remarks upon the Principles and Reasonings of Dr. Rutherforth: as human beings, we are naturally inclined towards happiness by our self-love, which is “increased by our practice of moral good” and in turn “naturally incline us to continue in that practice” (II: 20). Thomas Rutherforth (1712-1771) notes that if the desire of our happiness (that is, our own interest) expands in proportion to our practice of virtue, it follows that the more we are virtuous, the more we grow selfish, and paradoxically, the practice of virtue will be “fatal to itself, by strengthening that self-love” (Rutherforth 1744, 65). Cockburn objects to Rutherforth that although a vicious misapplication of self-love is actually dangerous to virtue—for instance if it is applied solely to private interest and self alone—true self-love is not the same as selfishness. Instead, it is a disinterested benevolence which involves the happiness of others. Thus our virtue, by strengthening our self-love, is in return strengthened by it. An “undeniable instance” of such a disinterested benevolence is provided by the “natural affection of parents for their children” (II: 20).

However, human beings are imperfect creatures, and when exposed to irregular passions, they can deviate from the rule of their duty. Thus God, who foresees everything, decided to link their natural duty to his own will by declaring that he would eternally reward obedience or punish disobedience. But in doing so, he gave Men only a new motive to the performance of their duty but no new foundation for it. To summarize, although Cockburn allows that eternal moral truths, Revelation, God’s command, and his will all play an important role in morality, she argues that they do not provide a sure and true foundation, since it is only in their conformity to rational and sociable human nature that they are moral motives for human beings. Cockburn adopts a strongly anthropocentric view of morality, which combine Locke’s principles of knowledge and Clarke’s metaphysical instances.

3. Religion

According to Thomas Birch, her official biographer, Catharine Cockburn was born in a Protestant family and she was therefore educated in the Anglican religion. Nevertheless, while she was very young, her intimacy with several unidentified Catholic families pushed her toward the Church of Rome, and she embraced that communion until 1707 when she converted back to the Church of England. Probably, her conversion was inspired by her long acquaintance with Gilbert and Elizabeth Burnet during her stay in Salisbury. Nonetheless, it seems to be a coherent consequence of her intellectual and philosophical trajectory.

Cockburn’s view on religion was neither rigid nor enthusiastic: she was not a fierce follower of her communion, and at the same time, she was allergic to any blind faith in dogmas. On the contrary, she believed that the best religion was “the knowledge and practice of our duty” in agreement to God’s revelation (II: 157). She explains that since happiness is for human beings the primary and necessary motive of all their actions, and it consists in living suitably to their rational and sociable nature, it follows that “our duty” consists exactly in living suitably to our nature. Now, a true religion must necessarily aim at guiding men in the correct practice of their duty, and it must therefore be both reasonable and committed to politics. As regards reasonableness, Cockburn rejects the Remarker’s position that religion would be “better established on the nature of God” (I: 59), arguing that the nature and will of God can be seen as a strong foundation of religion only insofar as they conform to human reason. As it concerns politics, Cockburn maintains that since men have a natural inclination toward other human beings and their happiness, a true religion must take care of the good of government and society. As a matter of fact, she concludes that if a religion should be unpolitic and destructive to society, it would necessarily be false, since “nothing can be a law to nature, which of direct consequence would destroy nature” (I: 59).

It is worth noting that in Cockburn’s antidogmatic view on religion, reasonableness and sociability are assumed as indispensable criteria of truth, and consequently there is not only one possible true religion, but any communion that satisfies those criteria would be true. She believed that Christianity should be grounded on a single necessary article of faith, namely the divine nature of Jesus Christ. Thus, all distinctions among churches did not concern necessary elements to salvation but depended only on formal aspects of the worship: simply, she explains that in reading dark passages in the Holy Scriptures, men give different interpretations of unessential articles of faith. However, these interpretations have too often been defended with excessive zeal, which had made “the terms of communion straighter than God has made the terms of salvation” (I: 14), therefore causing massacres and persecutions among Christians. Cockburn ironically notes that “those who are most bigoted to a sect, or most rigid and precise in their forms and outward discipline, are most negligent of the moral duties, which certainly are the main end of religion” (II: 177). On the contrary, she believed that during the Reformation, there was “rather a separation of than from the church” (II: 135), and none of the resulting communions had the absolute authority to direct our faith. Otherwise, the Scripture would have given us incontestable directions to find the true faith. Accordingly, she argues that since there is no church in the world that is infallible and absolutely perfect in all points, everyone should follow that church that she/he is satisfied with, even if some of the unessential points in it seem unconvincing, unless they are proven to be dangerous for salvation. Moreover, she believed that such a choice was not irreversible, for all human beings have the right to read directly the Holy Scriptures, and they should also “have the liberty of judging for themselves” (I: 24) whether or not their church acts in agreement with the words of God. Similarly, she found unacceptable the pretence of infallibility of the Church of Rome, because it was not confirmed by textual evidence. Thus, she eventually decided to go back to the Church of England.

4. Metaphysical Issues

In her philosophical writings, Catharine Cockburn also deals with a variety of metaphysical issues, some of which are closely connected with her account of morality. Among others she was particularly concerned with the following two: (a) the nature of the soul and the related themes of its immateriality, immortality, and the possibility of thinking matter; and b() the ontological reality of space.

a. The Nature of the Soul

In his Essay Concerning Human Understanding, John Locke argues against Descartes that the cogitative activity of the soul is not continuous, and “that the soul always thinks” is not a self-evident proposition and needs proof and the support of experience. However, experience itself clearly shows that the soul is sometimes absolutely without thought, for example, in a deep and dreamless sleep. According to Locke, thought is to the soul what motion is to the body, that is, one of its operations—maybe the most peculiar—but not its essence. Thus, as the body does not always move, so the soul does not necessarily always think. Locke also emphasizes that “our faculties cannot arrive at demonstrative certainty” of the immateriality of the soul, although it is highly probable. However, the highest degree of probability does not exclude the possibility of thinking matter, for “God may, if he pleases, give, or have given to some systems of matter a power to conceive and think” (Locke 1824, IV.3: §6).

The author of the Remarks upon an Essay Concerning Humane Understanding expresses serious worries over Locke’s view, insinuating that it could endanger the immortality of the soul, fostering materialism and atheism. Catharine Cockburn carefully examines the Remarker’s objections and replies point by point.

Firstly, she claims that since the supposition that “the soul always thinks” does not prove that it is immortal, the contrary supposition does not take away any proof of its immortality. Her reasoning proceeds as follows:

(1)   “The soul always thinks.” (a) is not a necessary truth, as Locke had shown;

(2)   If (1), then the contrary proposition, that is, “the soul does not always think” (b), is at least possible;

(3)   Even if thinking were necessary for a soul to exist now—this is far from being demonstrated—this would neither prove that that soul has always existed, nor that it will always exist;

(4)   From (3), it follows that (a) does not provide sufficient evidence for the immortality of the soul;

(5)   From (2) and (4), it follows that (b) cannot be necessarily taken as an argument against the immortality of the soul.

Therefore, she concludes—rebuffing the objections by the Remarker—that Locke’s hypothesis that men do not think in sound sleep does not weaken the Christian doctrine of immortality.

Secondly, the Remarker is particularly afraid that if all our thoughts be extinct in sound sleep, the soul itself would be extinct as well, and we would have a new soul every morning, or in other words, we would be new men every day. According to the Remarker, this is extremely dangerous for the doctrine of Resurrection; for how could we be the same persons on Judgement Day if we are different men every day?

Cockburn insightfully tackles her adversary’s difficulty by stressing that as a body continues with its existence when any motion ceases, and it is always the same body when a new motion is produced, so the soul exists even during an unthinking sleep, and it is the same soul when it wakes up. She imputes to the Remarker a loose use of language, especially when he takes soul, man, and person to signify the same thing, ignoring that for Locke these terms have different meanings: man is understood as the union of soul and body, and person as self-consciousness. According to Locke, consciousness only makes the same person: in fact, despite all changes that a man’s body can suffer throughout his life, he continues to recognize himself as himself, inasmuch as he has consciousness of his past actions and thoughts. As his consciousness extends backwards, so his personal identity reaches. Cockburn was sure that this was sufficient to prove that Locke’s view on identity was consistent with Christian Revelation and that it did not imply any sort of Deism as the Remarker had insinuated.

Interestingly, in defending Locke’s position, she points out that personal identity consists “in the same consciousness, and not in the same substance: in fact, whatever substance there is, without consciousness there is no person,” and “wherever there are two distinct incommunicable consciousnesses, there are two distinct persons, though in the same substance” (I:, 73). It is not clear whether Cockburn’s interpretation was entirely faithful to Locke’s view on identity, and in fact, commentators still disagree as to whether Locke entertained a substance-based or a mode-based theory of person. This is a long debate which can be traced back to Edmund Law (1703-1787), who was the first proponent of a mode reading of Locke’s view in his Defence of Mr. Locke’s Opinion Concerning Personal Identity (1769). However, although Cockburn could not enter into such a controversy since it was not yet in place when she died, it is evident that she gave a mode interpretation of Locke’s theory of personal identity over sixty years before Law (Gordon-Roth 2015, 71-72).

Thirdly, regarding the Remarker’s concerns with thinking matter, Cockburn notes that we have only an idea of the nature of the soul formed upon its operations, but we ignore whether the soul has essential properties distinct from matter, whereby it alone has the power of thinking. By echoing Locke’s agnosticism regarding substantial dualism, Cockburn emphasizes that we do not know whether there is an ontological and substantial difference between thinking and unthinking beings, and consequently, we ignore whether the substratum, which supports thought, is material or immaterial. Furthermore, she shows that the Remarker’s strategy of considering the immateriality of the soul as the main proof of its immortality has dangerous consequences for morality. In fact, she observes that human beings generally lack either leisure or capacity for metaphysical speculations, and if they believe that soul is immortal, it is irrelevant whether they consider it immaterial or not. However, if we rest the proof of the immortality of the soul on its immateriality, it would be sufficient to weaken the proofs of soul’s immateriality in order to debunk our belief in its immortality (Gordon-Roth 2015, 67-69).

Despite her trenchant criticism against the Remarker, it is evident that Cockburn did not necessarily disagree with him on the immateriality of the soul—and indeed, she never argued that the soul is corporeal. She adopted an astute three-point strategy: first, she emphasized that any claim about the nature of the soul must be demonstrated, since it is beyond the limit of our understanding; second, she showed that the hypothesis of the soul’s immateriality can have dangerous implications for morality; and third, she pushed the burden of proof to her adversary, who had to prove why his view was preferable to Locke’s (Thomas 2015, 258; Gordon-Roth 2015, 70).

b. The Reality of Space

In her Remarks upon Some Writers (1743), Catharine Cockburn examines, among other things, some of Edmund Law’s objections against Samuel Clarke concerning the nature of space.

Clarke argued that space necessarily exists because it is an entity that contains things and matter. Although it is not sensible, it cannot be nothing, since space has properties, while “nothing” does not: space has quantity and dimension; it is infinite, immutable, continuous, uncreated, and eternal. Nevertheless, Clarke had also defined space and time as divine properties or modes, which are not independent beings but depend on the only self-subsisting being, namely God.

Law objected that space is only an abstract idea in our mind that is formed by perceiving extended substances and abstracting from them the idea of space. He also rejected Clarke’s position that space is a real being because it has the property of containing bodies, since this makes no more sense than saying that darkness has qualities because it has the property of receiving light. According to Law, space is nothing or just an absence of extended bodies, and for this reason it does not have any properties.

Against Law’s view, Cockburn affirms the real existence of space. She argues that while “extension” is an abstract idea that can be predicated of both space and matter, “space” is not. Actually, space, matter, and extension are strictly connected notions, but space consists neither in matter nor in extension. Rather, she believed that the idea of space is “early obtruded upon the mind by senses, and unavoidable perceived by it” (I: 389), and accordingly, it precedes the idea of extension and does not depend upon our capability of abstracting. Moreover, we could neither conceive the real existence of bodies nor their motion without the idea of space, where they exist and move. Thus, we should admit or reject them altogether.

In the same writing, Cockburn also considers Isaac Watts’ view on space, according to which we do not know what class of beings space should be placed into. Watts had argued that space cannot be a mode of being (because its idea subsists independently of the existence of other beings), but it is not a substance neither (because it is neither material nor spiritual), and it cannot be God (because while space is measurable, God is not at all). Thus, Watts concludes that space “must be nothing” (Watts 1733, 19). Cockburn objects that Cartesian substantial dualism—manifestly adopted by Watts—does not provide a necessarily adequate division of being, and she conversely observes “that there may be other substances than either spirits or bodies” (I: 390). Explicitly embracing the doctrine of the “great chain of beings” (I: 391), Cockburn holds that there is a gradual progression in the ontological structure of nature, by which the most imperfect beings are connected to those that are close to perfection. Since this hierarchical organization of beings must be full and continuous, “there should be in nature some being to fill up the vast chasm betwixt body and spirit, otherwise the gradation would fail, and the chain would seem to be broken. […] And why may not space be such a being” (I: 391)? Thus, she concludes that we cannot define space as nothing just because we do not know what it is. Otherwise we should come to the same conclusion about unextended substances whose reality we have no idea of.

Finally, assuming space to be a real being, Cockburn was inclined not to ascribe infinity to space. She considers two kinds of infinity: a positive infinity and a negative one. Positive infinity, as described by Clarke, is understood as a metaphysical infinity, namely an absolute perfection, to which nothing can be added. In this sense, infinite space can be identified with an attribute of God. Negative infinity—as Locke had explained—is something to which more can be endlessly added. Cockburn notes that such a notion of infinity can only be applied to general abstract ideas such as number, duration, and extension, but “it should not be ascribed to space by those who allow space to be a real particular being” (I: 401).

Cockburn’s substantival account of space has been recently seen as a further proof of her intellectual autonomy and philosophical originality: it offers a credible third way between Descartes’ view that space is a substance but with no divine properties, and Newton’s position that space has many properties, including all those usually attributed to God, but it is not a substance (Thomas 2013).

5. Originality

In the 21st century, Catharine Cockburn’s acumen has been recognized by commentators, and an increasing quantity of literature shows that she had original philosophical positions, although some scholars do not consider it fully new (Nuovo 2011, 248-249).

As noted above, all her philosophical works were written in defense of either Locke or Clarke, and she was consequently forced in turn to follow the line of reasoning of their critics. However, her writings and private correspondence show that her intention was not merely to vindicate those eminent philosophers but rather to enter into the most lively controversies of that time and contribute to them.

In Cockburn’s philosophy, we have found at least four marks of originality and intellectual autonomy:

First, we have seen that she was selective about which ideas of Locke’s and Clarke’s to defend. Particularly, although her idea of fitness aligns with Clarke’s, there are strong reasons to believe that she had developed her own view independently (Bolton 1993).

Second, we have considered that her view of moral obligation was grounded in human reason and sociability, showing that it clearly differs from Locke’s view that obligation is constituted in superior decree (Sheridan 2007).

Third, Cockburn anticipated a strong debate concerning the interpretation of Locke’s theory of personal identity, proposing a mode reading over sixty years before Edmund Law, who has been generally seen as the first proponent of this interpretation (Gordon-Roth 2015).

Fourth, we have examined her hypothesis of the ontological reality of space, according to which space is a substance and has divine properties. In this doctrine, some commentators have seen an original alternative both to Descartes’ dualistic view and Newton’s non-substantial theory of space (Thomas 2013).

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Burnet, Thomas (?). 1697a. Remarks upon an Essay Concerning Humane Understanding: In a Letter Addres’d to the Author. London: Wotton.
  • Burnet, Thomas (?). 1697b. Second Remarks upon an Essay Concerning Humane Understanding: In a Letter Addres’d to the Author. London: Wotton.
  • Burnet, Thomas (?). 1699. Third Remarks upon an Essay Concerning Humane Understanding: In a Letter Addres’d to the Author. London: Wotton.
  • Clarke, Samuel. 1998. A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God. Edited by Ezio Vailati. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cockburn, Catharine (née Trotter). 1751. The Works of Mrs. Cockburn, Theological, Moral, Dramatic, and Poetical, Several of Them Now First Printed, Revised and Published with an Account of the Life of the Author by Thomas Birch. 2 vols., London: J. and P. Knapton.
  • King, William. 1731. An Essay on the Origin of Evil. Edited and Translated by Edmund Law. London: Thurlbourn.
  • Locke, John. 1824. “An Essay Concerning Human Understanding.” 4th edition. In The Works of John Locke in Nine Volumes, edited by John Locke. London: Rivington.
  • Rutherforth, Thomas. 1744. An Essay on the Nature and Obligations of Virtue. London: Thurlbourn.
  • Watts, Isaac. 1733 Philosophical Essays on Various Subjects, 2nd edition. London: R. Ford.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bolton, Martha Brandt. 1993. “Some Aspects of the Philosophy of Catharine Trotter.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 31, no. 4: 565-88.
    • A classic in Cockburn scholarship, this is one of the first papers that consider Catharine Trotter Cockburn as an original and independent philosopher.
  • Broad, Jacqueline. 2002. Women Philosophers of the Seventeenth Century. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • A detailed analysis of the contribution of women to philosophy in early modern England. Broad explores the philosophical writings of five figures, including Margaret Cavendish, Anne Conway, Mary Astell, and Catharine Trotter Cockburn.
  • Connor, Margaret. 1995. “Catharine Trotter: An Unknown Child.” American Notes and Queries. Quarterly Journal of Short Articles 8, no. 4: 11-14.
    • This brief paper unconvincingly questions Cockburn’s birthdate.
  • De Tommaso, Emilio M. 2017a. “Il razionalismo etico di Catharine Trotter Cockburn.” Intersezioni XXXVII-1: 19-38.
    • A study of Cockburn’s moral philosophy presented as a sort of ethical rationalism.
  • De Tommaso, Emilio M. 2017b. “‘Some Reflections upon the True Grounds of Morality’—Catharine Trotter in Defence of John Locke.” Philosophy Study 7, no. 6: 326-339.
    • An analysis of Cockburn’s main arguments in favor of the compatibility between morality and Locke’s epistemology.
  • Duran, Jane. 2013. “Early English Empiricism and the Work of Catharine Trotter Cockburn.” Metaphilosophy 44: 485-94.
    • An examination of the empiricist legacy of Cockburn’s philosophy.
  • Gordon-Roth, Jessica. 2015. “Catharine Trotter Cockburn’s Defence of Locke.” The Monist 98: 64-76.
    • An excellent examination of some metaphysical issues in Cockburn’s Defence of Locke, including the immateriality and immortality of the soul.
  • Hutton, Sarah. 1998. “Cockburn, Catharine (1679-1749).” In Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, edited by Edward Craig. Routledge: London. doi: 10.4324/9780415249126-DA017-1
  • Kelley, Anne. 2001. “‘In Search of Truths Sublime’: Reason and the Body in the Writings of Catharine Trotter.” Women’s Writing 8, no. 2: 235-50.
    • Argues that Cockburn’s project was to challenge the convention of women’s intellectual and moral inferiority, demanding their right to a public voice.
  • Kelley, Anne. 2002. Catharine Trotter an Early Modern Writer in the Vanguard of Feminism. Aldershot: Ashgate.
    • A milestone in Cockburn scholarship covering both her literary and philosophical works.
  • Linker, Laura. 2010. “Catharine Trotter and the Humane Libertine.” Studies in English Literature 1500-1900 50, no. 3: 583-99.
    • An insightful examination of some libertine resonances in Cockburn’s comedy Love at Loss. The paper also focuses on women’s lack of power, especially after marriage.
  • Myers, Joanne E. 2012. “Catharine Trotter and the Claims of Conscience.” Tulsa Studies in Women's Literature 31, no. 1/2: 53-75.
    • A comprehensive analysis of the role of religious themes in Cockburn’s writing.
  • Nuovo, Victor. 2011. Christianity, Antiquity, and Enlightenment: Interpretations of Locke. New York: Springer.
    • In this detailed collection of essays on the Christian philosophy of John Locke, Victor Nuovo devotes a chapter to Catharine Cockburn’s enlightenment.
  • O’Neill, Eileen. 2005. “Early Modern Women Philosophers and the History of Philosophy.” Hypatia 20, no. 3: 185-97.
    • This is an in-depth analysis of the reasons why early modern women philosophers disappeared from the history of philosophy by the twentieth century.
  • Ready, Kathryn J. 2002. “Damaris Cudworth Masham, Catharine Trotter Cockburn, and the Feminist Legacy of Locke’s Theory of Personal Identity.” Eighteenth-Century Studies 35, no. 4: 563-76.
    • This paper emphasizes the feminist implications of both Masham’s and Cockburn’s interpretations of Locke’s view on personhood.
  • Sheridan, Patricia. 2007. “Reflection, Nature, and Moral Law: The Extent of Catharine Cockburn's Lockeanism in her Defence of Mr. Locke’s .Hypatia 22, no. 3: 133-51.
    • A thorough examination of Cockburn’s Defence. The author provides convincing proof of Cockburn’s originality and independence from Locke.
  • Sheridan, Patricia. 2011. “Catharine Trotter Cockburn.” In the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • Sund, Elizabeth. 2013. “The Right to Resist: Women’s Citizenship in Catharine Trotter Cockburn’s The Revolution of Sweden.” In Political Ideas of Enlightenment Women: Virtue and Citizenship, edited by L. Curtis-Wendlandt, P. Gibbard, K. Green, 141-156., New York: Ashgate.
    • This essay focuses on Cockburn’s view on citizenship, exploring political and feminist concerns in her final play, The Revolution of Sweden.
  • Thomas, Emily. 2013. “Catharine Cockburn on Substantival Space.” History of Philosophy Quarterly 30, no. 3: 195-214.
    • Provides evidence that Cockburn’s account of substantival space was new and original.
  • Thomas, Emily. 2015. “Catharine Cockburn on Unthinking Immaterial Substance: Souls, Space, and Related Matters.” Philosophy Compass 10, no. 4: 255-63.
    • A careful examination of metaphysical themes in Cockburn’s philosophical works.
  • Waithe, Mary Ellen. 1991. “Catharine Trotter Cockburn.” In A History of Women Philosophers. Vol. III: Modern Women Philosophers, 1600-1900, edited by M.E. Waithe, 101-125. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
    • One of the first works that includes Cockburn in the history of philosophy. It explores her moral philosophy and some metaphysical issues as presented in her Defence of Mr. Locke’s Essay.
  • Walmsley, J.C., Hugh Craig, and John Burrows. 2016. “The Authorship of the Remarks upon an Essay Concerning Humane Understanding.” Eighteenth-Century Thought 6: 205-43.
    • Argues that attribution to Richard Willis is more probable than the traditional attribution to Thomas Burnet.
  • Williams, Jane. 1861. “Catharine Cockburn.” In The Literary Women of England, edited by J. Williams, 170-188. London: Saunders, Oatley and Co.
    • In her broad study of the literary women of England, Jane Williams devotes some pages to Catharine Cockburn.


Author Information

Emilio Maria De Tommaso
University of Calabria