Cognitive relativism asserts the relativity of truth. Because of the close connections between the concept of truth and concepts such as knowledge, rationality, and justification, cognitive relativism is often taken to encompass, or imply, the relativity of these other notions also. Thus, epistemological relativism, which asserts the relativity of knowledge, may be understood as a version of cognitive relativism, or at least as entailed by it.
This kind of relativism can take different forms depending on the nature of the standpoint or framework to which truth is relativized. If truth is relativized to the individual subject, for instance, the result is a form of subjectivism. If the standpoint is an entire culture, the result is some form of cultural relativism. Other possible frameworks include languages, historical periods, and conceptual schemes. These frameworks do not exclude one another, of course, and in the positions developed by thinkers such as Thomas Kuhn and Michel Foucault (both generally regarded as holding relativistic views of truth) they are presented as interwoven.
Cognitive relativism is not so widely held as moral relativism. Moral relativism is the view that moral judgments (those employing concepts like good, bad, right or wrong) should only be assessed relative to a particular, limited standpoint (usually that of a specific culture). This doctrine became a commonplace for many growing up in modernized societies in the second half of the twentieth century and is virtually the default position encountered among undergraduates by countless philosophy instructors today. One major reason for its popularity is the importance attached by so many thinkers to the distinction between facts and values. Factual judgments are generally thought to be objective and provable; value judgments, by contrast, are commonly held to express subjective attitudes and to be unprovable, rather like judgments of taste.
Gradually, however, cognitive relativism has gained in credibility as the sharp logical dichotomy between facts ands values has been increasingly questioned. Instead of a dichotomy, many now argue for a spectrum of judgments with a greater or lesser evaluative component to them. Moreover, these components themselves may not be seen as radically different; they may, for instance, simply reflect the degree to which a judgment is controversial within a particular community, with what we call factual judgments being the least disputed. From this point of view, cognitive relativism is broader and more fundamental than moral relativism, for it asserts that the truth value of all judgments, not just moral ones, is relative.
Table of Contents
- Ancient relativism
- The emergence of relativism in modern times
- The definition of relativism
- Arguments for relativism
- Objections to relativism
- References and Further Reading
In Western philosophy, relativism first appears as a philosophical outlook associated with the Sophists in fifth century Greece. Cosmopolitan and skeptically inclined, these traveling intellectuals were struck by the variations in law, mores, practices and beliefs found in different communities. They drew the conclusion that much of what is commonly regarded as natural is in fact a matter of convention. There is thus no objectively right way to worship the gods or organize society, any more than there is an objectively correct way to dress or to prepare food. The main critical thrust of this way of thinking was directed against traditional moral and political values, but the relativity of truth itself seems to be implicated in Protagoras’ famous assertion that “man is the measure of all things–of things that are, that they are, and of things that are not, that they are not.” The fact that the sophists taught rhetoric, and in stressing the value of persuasion appeared indifferent to questions of truth, reinforced this attitude.
The first great critic of relativism was Plato. In the Theatetus, he links Protagorean relativism to the view that knowledge should be identified with sense perception, and also to the Heracleitean doctrine that reality is in a continual state of flux. Plato’s criticisms of Protagoras’ position prefigures arguments advanced against relativism by its critics ever since. One objection he raises is that relativism collapses the distinction between truth and falsity; for if each individual is really the “measure” of what is, then everyone would be infallible, which is absurd. The implausibility of the Protagorean thesis is especially obvious, Plato argues, when we consider two people making incompatible predictions about the future. Events will prove that one of them, at least, was not a good measure of what is true. His other main objection is that relativism is self-refuting. If Protagoras is right, then whatever a person thinks is true, is true. But in that case, Protagoras must concede that those who think relativism is false are correct. So if Protagorean relativism is true, it must also be false.
Although skepticism about the possibility of knowledge became part of the mainstream of ancient philosophy, relativism did not. Socrates and Plato may be willing to concede that human understanding, in this life at least, is very limited, but they do not doubt the existence of an ideal vantage point from which the objective truth about the world could be known. Also, Aristotle appears fairly confident that such a vantage point is accessible to human reason properly employed.
Between Aristotle and Kant there are no major Western philosophers who one could plausibly describe as cognitive relativists. Montaigne and Hume certainly stressed the importance of custom in shaping peoples’ beliefs, especially on moral matters; but this led them towards skepticism rather than relativism. The door to modern relativism was unlocked by Kant’s claim in the Critique of Pure Reason that the only world we can know or talk about meaningfully is one that has been shaped by the human mind. On Kant’s view, the concept of “objective reality” is employed speculatively and hence illegitimately if it is taken to refer to reality as it is independent of our experience of it. This obviously has implications for the traditional notion of objective truth. The judgments we call true are true for us and of our world; but to claim they are true in the sense of describing an independently existing reality is to go beyond what we can meaningfully or justifiably assert.
Kant is not generally considered a relativist since he held that the forms our mind imposes on the world are common to all human beings. Truths like the truths of geometry or the statement that every event is caused are thus universally accepted and constitute a priori knowledge. The forms we impose on experience also give the world a certain necessary character that is independent of our beliefs and wishes. For instance, causes must precede their effect, and time can only flow in one direction. In this sense, the forms confer objectivity on the world we experience, and our well-founded judgments about that world can be called objectively true. Later thinkers, however, took Kant’s ideas further down the road toward fully-fledged relativism. Hegel, while upholding a concept of “absolute knowledge”, allows every stage that human consciousness has passed through in the historical development of civilization to express an outlook that is true in a partial way. Marx highlights the influence of the mode of production along with class and economic interests in shaping the way people understand their world; and although he appears to recognize the epistemic authority of science in some areas, he rejects the idea of a neutral standpoint from which to adjudicate between different views of social reality. Nietzsche is explicitly relativistic about both moral values and truth, preferring to evaluate claims according to what sort of will to power the claims express rather than according to their objective truth-value.
In the twentieth century, a relativistic view of truth can be found in or inferred from the work of many major philosophers, including James, Dewey, Wittgenstein, Quine, Kuhn, Gadamer, Foucault, Rorty, and most of those commonly labeled “postmodernists”. Numerous others, including some who regard themselves as staunch opponents of relativism, have been accused of harbouring relativistic tendencies. There is thus a general consensus that modern philosophy has shifted in a relativistic direction. Even fierce critics of relativism like Allan Bloom (author of The Closing of the American Mind) concede this. Indeed, it is this trend, along with its trickle down effect on the outlook of rising generations, that occasions lamentations such as his.
There is no general agreed upon definition of cognitive relativism. Here is how it has been described by a few major theorists:
- “Reason is whatever the norms of the local culture believe it to be”. (Hilary Putnam, Realism and Reason: Philosophical Papers, Volume 3 (Cambridge, 1983), p. 235.)
- “The choice between competing theories is arbitrary, since there is no such thing as objective truth.” (Karl Popper, The Open Society and its Enemies, Vol. II (London, 1963), p. 369f.)
- “There is no unique truth, no unique objective reality” (Ernest Gellner, Relativism and the Social Sciences (Cambridge, 1985), p. 84.)
- “There is no substantive overarching framework in which radically different and alternative schemes are commensurable” (Richard Bernstein, Beyond Objectivism and Relativism (Philadelphia, 1985), pp. 11-12.)
- “There is nothing to be said about either truth or rationality apart from descriptions of the familiar procedures of justification which a given society—ours—uses in one area of enquiry” (Richard Rorty, Objectivity, Relativism and Truth: Philosophical Papers, Volume 1 (Cambridge, 1991), p. 23.)
Without doubt, this lack of consensus about exactly what relativism asserts is one reason for the unsatisfactory character of much of the debate about its coherence and plausibility. Another reason is that very few philosophers are willing to apply the label “relativist” to themselves. Even Richard Rorty, who is widely regarded as one of the most articulate defenders of relativism, prefers to describe himself as a “pragmatist”, an “ironist” and an “ethnocentrist”.
Nevertheless, a reasonable definition of relativism may be constructed: one that describes the fundamental outlook of thinkers like Rorty, Kuhn, or Foucault while raising the hackles of their critics in the right way.
Cognitive relativism consists of two claims:
(1) The truth-value of any statement is always relative to some particular standpoint;
(2) No standpoint is metaphysically privileged over all others.
The first of these claims asserts the relativity of truth, obviously an essential element in this form of relativism. Oddly, though, this is not the most controversial part of the doctrine. After all, even committed realists might be willing to conceive of objective truth as equivalent to “true from a God’s eye point of view” or “true from the standpoint of the cosmos”. It is this second claim, the denial of any metaphysically privileged standpoint, that most provokes relativism’s critics. A brief look at the role of this thesis in the thought of three leading relativists–Kuhn, Rorty, and Foucault—will help reveal why it should be so controversial.
In The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, Kuhn argues that science progresses by means of what he calls paradigm shifts. A paradigm theory is an overarching theory like Dalton’s atomic theory or the theory of evolution. These provide the background conceptual scheme within which what Kuhn calls “normal science” occurs. On Kuhn’s account, a paradigm shift such as that by which Copernican astronomy displaced the Ptoemeic view of the universe should not be thought of as a shift between two different ways of looking at an independent reality. Rather, theory and observation are so intertwined that the shift amounts to a change in the reality the scientists inhabit. Consequently, there is no independent standpoint from which a paradigm shift can be judged to take us closer to a true picture of the way things really are. Kuhn likens debates over paradigms to political controversies, saying that “as in political revolutions, so in paradigm choice—there is no standard higher than the assent of the relevant community.” (p. 110)
Richard Rorty extends what Kuhn says about science to every other sphere of culture, particularly politics. The traditional view–call it Platonist, absolutist, objectivist or realist–is that when we do something like abolish slavery we move closer to an independent ideal and we bring our way of thinking closer to the One Right Way, the way dictated by reason or by our essential human nature. Rorty thinks this sort of thinking has been valuable in the past; but in more recent times it has become constraining rather than liberating. He therefore urges us to see intellectual and cultural progress as simply consisting in our exchanging one vocabulary for another. Descriptions of human beings that view them as entitled to equal rights before the law, and descriptions of the solar system that views it as heliocentric are both preferable to the descriptions they replaced; but not because they are closer to the truth. In both cases, we should prefer the newer descriptions on pragmatic grounds; they better enable us to achieve our purposes.
Michel Foucault’s relativism is similar to Kuhn’s in being based on and justified by historical researches. The domain of his studies is different, however. In works like Madness and Civilization, The Order of Things, and Discipline and Punish, Foucault tries to show how what we call “reason”, “science”, “knowledge” and “truth” are socially constituted and shaped by political forces. He argues that in order to pass muster as “scientific” or as “rational”, a discourse must satisfy certain conditions, and these conditions are socially and historically relative, reflecting the needs and interests of existing power structures. This relativity is more obvious in the case of classifications based on distinctions such as normal-perverted, natural-unnatural, rational-insane, or healthy-sick. But Foucault suggests that it applies also to other, more epistemologically central distinctions such as scientific-unscientific, knowledge-error, and true-false. The ideal of a neutral standpoint transcending epochs and interests is thus a chimera.
Relativism is the radical offspring of non-realism, which is itself descended from the idealism of Berkeley and Kant. Non-realism holds that we cannot meaningfully talk about they way things are independent of our experience of them: to use Michael Dummett’s formulation, what makes a statement true is not independent of our procedures for deciding it is true. The main argument in favour of non-realism is essentially negative: it avoids the difficulties endemic to metaphysical realism (a.k.a. “objectivism” or “absolutism”).
Realists hold that our judgments are true when they accurately describe or correspond to a reality that exists independently of our perceptions, conceptions, theories or desires. On this view, a true statement such as “water contains oxygen” describes a fact about this independent reality. It rests on a scientific model that may be said to “carve nature at the joints”. But an obvious question arises: how can we determine that our judgments are true in this sense? The obvious answer is that we test them by making experiments and observations. I say it will snow today, and I test this by watching the sky. I say water contains oxygen and I confirm this by showing that one of the elements separated out by electrolysis supports combustion. When our assertions are decisively confuted by experience, we conclude that they are false—i.e. they describe a state of affairs that does not obtain.
Relativists accept that this is how we normally conceive of truth and falsity—in ordinary usage, the word “true” means something like “corresponds to the facts”–and as an account of our everyday epistemic procedures it is unobjectionable. But they argue that it loses coherence if it is elevated to the metaphysical level. For what is really happening, even when we are confirming the most mundane belief about the empirical world, is that we are satisfying ourselves that this belief coheres with our other beliefs. We confirm that the sea is salty by tasting it or by conducting a chemical analysis of seawater. But these procedures only confirm our belief about sea water in the sense of showing it to be compatible with or even entailed by a host of other beliefs: for instance, that the sample we are examining is typical; that nothing else tastes quite like salt; that our sensory faculties are trustworthy on this occasion; that salt tastes roughly the same at different times. What we can never do, argue relativists and other non-realists, is check the degree of correspondence between our judgments and reality as it is independent of our experience of it. To do this we would have to take a “sideways on” view of the cognitive relation between subject and object. But this is impossible since any vantage point we adopt will necessarily be that of the subject. For the same reason, we cannot compare our overall conceptual scheme or theoretical model of reality with reality as it is “in itself.”
The driving idea behind empiricism and the upshot of Kant’s critique of speculative metaphysics is thus that concepts must be tied to experience if they are to have legitimate employment in science or philosophy. Relativists argue that the metaphysical realist’s concept of truth fails this test, for it takes the notion of “correspondence with reality” out of its everyday employment, where it is genuinely useful, and tries to press it into metaphysical service, where it is neither useful nor legitimate. So even if, in its normal usage, “truth” means something like correspondence with reality, the ultimate criterion of truth turns out to be coherence with other beliefs. To put it another way: our philosophical conception of truth cannot simply be an expanded version of our commonsense notion of truth as correspondence. And this implies that truth must always be relative to some belief system, to some particular epistemic standpoint. This is the first of the two theses identified above as constituting the doctrinal kernel of relativism. Numerous philosophers have affirmed it. Yet many of these have sought to avoid relativism by rejecting the second thesis—that no standpoint is metaphysically privileged over all others.
This second thesis is what gives relativism its bad name. Critics commonly reduce it to the claim that any point of view is as good as any other and then attack it with some variation of Plato’s arguments against Protagoras. But virtually no well-known philosophers actually hold that all standpoints are of equal worth. Richard Rorty, for instance, who is widely regarded as a relativist, dismisses that position as “silly.” (Richard Rorty, Objectivism, Relativism, and Truth, p. 89). Rorty, Kuhn and most other relativists accept that one can have cogent reasons for preferring one standpoint to another; the preferred point of view may, for instance, exhibit greater logical consistency or greater predictive power than other available perspectives. But they argue that such reasons cannot confer any special metaphysical status on the standpoint in question. They cannot, for instance, show it to be the one favoured by God, or dictated by Reason, or most in accord with human nature.
Relativists typically justify this conclusion along the following lines. Any proof of a standpoint’s superiority must rest on premises that express fundamental assumptions and basic values. For instance, arguments for the superiority of the standpoint of modern science over that of religion will presuppose the value of consistency, of solving theoretical puzzles, and of being able to manipulate one’s environment. A person who defends the literal truth of the bible but shares these values is likely to be persuaded fairly quickly by these arguments. But a person who holds that truth appears to humans as paradoxical, and who values tradition and religious faith over experimental evidence and predictive power will not be persuaded. An argument can only be convincing to one who accepts its premises. Some premises, though, like those just mentioned, are so fundamental that they are not usually argued for at all. Rather, they are constitutive of a particular outlook.
The relativists’ thesis is not that one cannot support standpoints with arguments; it is that in the end all such arguments must be circular since they inevitably rest on premises that are themselves part of the standpoint. Critics will here point out that there is a difference between denying that the superiority of one standpoint over all others can be proved and denying that such a standpoint exists. In reply, relativists are likely to claim that this distinction is an abstract one that no consistent empiricist or pragmatist would make. To insist that one standpoint is objectively superior to all others, they argue, even though there is no way of proving this, is dogmatic and pointless; to claim that one’s own standpoint enjoys this unique but undemonstrable superiority is dogmatic and implausible.
A critic might also object that what relativists call “cogent” reasons for preferring one standpoint to another are not epistemically relevant: that is, they do not provide grounds for thinking that the standpoint generates or ensures beliefs that are objectively true. But this is clearly a point most relativists would be willing to concede. The notion of objective truth referred to here is not a concept for which they have a use, preferring instead something like William James’ conception of truth as “what is good in the way of belief.”
Critics of relativism are legion, but the objections leveled against it are usually of two kinds, both pioneered by Plato in his critique of Protagoras. One line of attack tries to show that relativism is incoherent because it is self-refuting. The other common objection is that relativism, if taken seriously, would have bad practical consequences. Let us consider both of these in turn.
A doctrine is self-refuting if its truth implies its falsehood. Relativism asserts that the truth-value of a statement is always relative to some particular standpoint. This implies that the same statement can be both true and false. The qualification that the statement is true relative to standpoint A but false relative to standpoint B may save relativism from the charge of embracing gross contradictions. But it still clearly implies that relativism itself is false, at least relative to some standpoints. One might say that it is just as much false as it is true, in which case there seems to be no good reason to prefer relativism to alternative positions such as realism.
One possible response to this objection would be to modify the theory and hold that all truths are relative except for the truth that all truths are relative. On this view, the relativist thesis enjoys a unique status, being true in some non-relativistic sense. This position may be coherent, but it is rather implausible. It is hard to see what could justify granting the thesis of relativism this exceptional status. A more plausible option is for relativists to concede that their view is false relative to at least some non-relativistic theoretical frameworks but to deny that this admission is damaging. Relativism, they can claim, is simply in the same situation as any other theory. The theory of evolution is true from the perspective of modern science and false from the perspective of Christian fundamentalism. Relativists deny that one of these perspectives is demonstrably better than the other. But this does not mean that they cannot affirm the scientific perspective, and do so for cogent reasons. In the same way, they can acknowledge that relativism is false from the standpoint of metaphysical realism; but they can do this without inconsistency or incoherence since they are not metaphysical realists, and they have reasons for preferring relativism to realism.
A variation on the charge that relativism is self-refuting is the argument that it is somehow self-refuting for relativists to assert or to argue for their position. This line of attack has been pressed forcefully by Hilary Putnam and others. Putnam’s argument is that ordinary rational discourse presupposes a non-relativistic notion of truth. Jûrgen Habermas offers a similar sort of argument in his critique of postmodernists like Foucault and Derrida, claiming that a commitment to truth, like a commitment to sincerity, is a necessary condition of successful communication.
Relativists, however, are likely to remain skeptical about these alleged presuppositions and implicit commitments. It may be true that when we engage in rational discourse we implicitly commit ourselves to the truth of what we are saying. But it is not at all obvious that we implicitly commit ourselves to a non-relativistic conception of truth. And even if this were the case, it is not clear why this supposed presupposition of everyday communication should be accorded so much respect and made the basis for a philosophical account of truth. Our everyday notions of space and time may also be non-relativistic, but we do not demand that physicists’ theories of space and time conform to our pre-scientific ideas.
This criticism also was first ventured by Plato and continues to be endorsed by many. Cognitive relativism is thought to undermine our commitment to improving our ways of thinking rather as moral relativism is thought to undermine our belief in the possibility of moral progress. Several reasons have been given to support this anxiety. To some, the fact that relativism countenances the possibility of multiple true but incompatible points of view entails a kind of epistemic nihilism. If creationism and the theory of evolution, Ptolemaic and Copernican astronomy, astrology and modern psychology are all equally true, then what purpose is served by developing new scientific theories? All views are of equal value, so why not just rest content with whatever happens to be “true for us”?
Against this, relativists can offer two responses. First, truth is not the only epistemic value. We can also prefer theories on the basis of such values as coherence with our other beliefs, predictive power, and practical fruitfulness. Second, by endorsing relativism one does not lose the right to judge beliefs according to their truth or falsity. Modern relativists will believe that the earth orbits the sun and that Copernicus’ discovery represented scientific progress over earlier astronomy. But their philosophical account of the status of these beliefs will be relativistic. The Copernican theory is true and its acceptance represents progress according to the values and concerns that constitute the modern scientific standpoint—a standpoint shared by both relativists and non-relativists. The difference between them is that the relativists do not believe this standpoint can be proved superior to others except by arguments that are essentially circular and question-begging.
Hillary Putnam presses a slightly different version of the above objection. Relativism, he argues, tries to “naturalize” the concept of reason. What he means is that relativists try to discuss questions of truth, knowledge, and rationality in a thoroughly descriptive, non-normative way. Like social scientists afraid of allowing value-judgments to creep into their work, they take a detached stance and simply report the epistemic customs and practices of different cultures, eschewing any impulse to endorse or criticize them. And this amounts, in Putnam’s words, to “mental suicide”. For, while particular norms of rationality will be entrenched within a particular culture, reason has an inalienable critical or transcendent function which can be used to criticize existing epistemic norms. Relativism can thus be accused of encouraging a certain kind of intellectual passivity.
Relativists have also been accused of embracing determinism, and certainly thinkers like Nietzsche and Foucault sometimes invite this charge. The epistemic norms of a culture or a period are taken to be shaped by non-rational forces such as class interests, technology, or the will to power of a group or individual. And what people then come to believe is seen as a function of these norms. For example, Foucault suggests that the classification of homosexuality as a disease results from employing a certain kind of theoretical framework, one that posits a sharp distinction between the natural and the unnatural and correlates the former with the healthy, the latter with the sick. And this framework becomes established because it serves certain interests. So truth is identified with what is believed to be true, and what is believed to be true is determined by larger social forces operating within a culture or historical epoch.
This deterministic tendency, like the attempt to naturalize reason, is held by critics to entail, or at least encourage, a renunciation of the longstanding project of using reason to criticize existing norms, beliefs, and practices in order to furnish ourselves with better ones. Relativism is thus associated with the counter-Enlightenment aspects of postmodernism. But association is not the same thing as logical entailment. It may well be true that some relativists are drawn towards determinism or feel they must eschew value judgments. But it is not clear that these tendencies must be part of a relativistic outlook. Other relativists will argue that the connection between relativism and determinism, say, is historical and contingent rather than logical and necessary. In their view, one can consistently endorse a relativistic view of truth while still being committed to the relative superiority of some views over others, to the value of critical reflection, and to the possibility of using reason as an instrument of scientific and social progress.
Cognitive relativism continues to be an important but controversial position that one encounters in contemporary debates about the nature of truth, knowledge, rationality, and science. These debates can sometimes be confusing because people neither agree about exactly what relativism affirms, nor about whose views should be described as a relativistic.
Critics of relativism sometimes seem to assume that relativists are denying that they believe—or denying themselves the right to believe—obvious truths. But the more sophisticated relativists do not deny that statements like “the earth is round” are true. They just favour a certain philosophical account of what is involved and implied when we describe such statements as “true”. The situation here is reminiscent of the debate between idealists and some of their materialist critics. The critics charge idealists like Berkeley with holding that our sense perceptions are illusions, and they think they can refute this doctrine by doing things like kicking stones. But the idealists do not see themselves as holding or implying any such view. They just think that the materialist explanation of our sense-experiences is philosophically problematic; so they offer what they take to be a more coherent alternative.
On the other hand, relativism is sometimes advanced quite crudely. Then, instead of being a philosophical view about the status of our beliefs and the limitations on how we might support these beliefs, it becomes an excuse for accepting uncritically one’s own culture’s assumptions and epistemic norms; or it serves to rationalize intellectual apathy or slackness masquerading as tolerance of diverse opinions. Just as idealists still have to negotiate what we normally call the material world, so relativists have to make decisions about whether particular claims are true or false. Their philosophical relativism may incline them towards being more open-minded and tolerant than dyed-in-the-wool absolutists and objectivists. But they cannot avoid adopting specific standpoints, choosing between theories, and endorsing particular beliefs and values. At bottom, the debate over relativism is about whether it is possible for relativists to make these commitments consistently and sincerely.
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Last updated: May 24, 2006 | Originally published: May/24/2006