Philosophy has long struggled to understand the nature of color. The central role color plays in our lives, in visual experience, in art, as a metaphor for emotions, has made it an obvious candidate for philosophical reflection. Understanding the nature of color, however, has proved a daunting task, despite the numerous fields that contribute to the project. Even knowing how to start can be difficult. Is color to be understood as an objective part of reality, a property of objects with a status similar to shape and size? Or is color more like pain, to be found only in experience and so somehow subjective? Or is color more like what some have said about time—that it seems real until we reflect enough, where we come ultimately to dismiss it as mere illusion? If color is more like shape and size, can we give a scientific account of it? Various strategies exist for this option—taking the color of an object to be just a complicated texture of that object, one that reflects certain wavelengths. Or perhaps color is merely a disposition to cause experiences in us, as salt has a disposition to dissolve. On the other hand, if color is more like pain, and found only in subjective experience, what is the nature of color experience? How, for instance, does an experience of red differ from an experience of blue, or from an experience of pain for that matter? Finally, if color is mere illusion, how do we continue to be so taken in by that illusion and how can something unreal seem so real and important to us?
There are just some of the questions that have been raised about color, ones we will address in this article. Of course, this is only a beginning, for it is not only the scientist or scientifically-inclined philosopher that wonders about color. Accounts of color have been given by anthropologists, artists, philosophers interested in metaphysics, and many others. How their accounts go, and how they all fit together makes for fascinating philosophy. This article will offer an introduction to philosophical issues of color, with an eye to exploring some of the answers that have been offered to some of the puzzles. As always in philosophy, the discussion has to begin somewhere, though it need not ever end.
Many contemporary debates about color have their origin in the rise of modern science. The emerging scientific picture of the 16th and 17th centuries demoted color, sound, taste and other aesthetically interesting properties to second-class status, according them the pejorative title of “secondary qualities.” Primary qualities, such as shape, size, motion, and number, in contrast, seemed necessary and sufficient to explain the behavior of physical objects and were thereby countenanced by the new physics as the truly real. From the perspective of physics, secondary qualities such as color were deemed explanatorily idle, and thus at best were said to be present in bodies only as complex structures of primary qualities, and so do not resemble our ideas of them. At worst, color and the like were dismissed as mere illusory appearances. Color would no more be in objects than pain is. Either way, the world was seen as not colored—or at least, if there is color in reality, it bears little resemblance to the color we are so intimately aware of.
With this background, contemporary philosophers face a choice of sorts. Should color be assimilated, on the one hand, to shape and size, and thus accountable in a scientific manner, not requiring appeal to sensory experience? Or, on the other hand, are colors more like sensations of pain, and thus personal, subjective features of experience? These questions trigger different responses, and so determine numerous accounts of the nature of color. Early portions of this article will examine the interplay between common sense and science on the nature of color, with an eye to answering those questions.
But philosophical issues of color are not limited to these debates. Color plays such an important role in our lives, in so many different ways, that it is not surprising that other issues should arise. We will explore some of these as well. Like children then, philosophers are fascinated by color. Unlike children, we have sophisticated concepts and tools at our disposal to help us understand the mysteries of color.
To begin let us ask, “Are physical objects, independently of perceivers’ experiences, colored? Again, were we to discard what is found in experience, would it still be correct to say that objects are colored?”
Realism about color, as understood here, maintains that yes, objects are colored. In particular, Realism holds that objects are colored, regardless of whether anyone is looking at an object, regardless if the color is perceived. In so maintaining that objects are colored, we are saying that the essence of color is to be found in the nature of the objects that are colored, as opposed to being within the minds of perceivers. Subjectivism, on the other hand, holds that it is false to say that objects are colored. But even if objects are not colored, surely there are experiences of color. And in this way we can find a place for color, by including the perceivers and perception of color. Subjectivism gets its name because of the role of the subjects of experience, where color is now to be found. In saying that color exists within subjective experiences of color, however, we need not mean there is something arbitrary or illusory about color. Color could be something that really does exist within perceivers, which can be studied, measured, and explained.
As we articulate these positions more precisely, we will discover that there are various ways to claim that objects are colored, just as there are various ways to understand the claim that there are only experiences of color. Due to limitations of space, we can only hope to introduce the reader to some of the positions and complexities of the debate, and hope that is enough to both satisfy one’s initial curiosity and to also spur one to learn more.
Realism holds that objects are colored. So does common sense. Science, particularly physics, apparently threatens that view. For science tells us, in the first place, that ordinary objects—trees, houses, cars, are themselves just complexes of more basic items (atoms, protons, electrons, quarks, and so forth). And in the second place, these scientific objects are not colored. We thus seem on the verge of paradox as we consider the following two claims.
CS: (Ordinary) objects are colored.
CP: Ordinary objects are bundles of basic scientific objects.
PS: Basic scientific objects are not colored.
(Though CP is clearly relevant to this discussion, it will not be explored further.) What then should we say about CS, the claim that common sense objects are colored, given the hard to deny threat posed by PS, the claim that the physicist’s entities are not colored? Several strategies emerge.
Non-Reductive Realism about color holds there to be no distinction between what are called the primary and secondary qualities of objects. Both types exist in the object just as they present themselves. A red ball looks to have primary qualities (the shape, size, mass, and so forth) and secondary qualities (the color, the smell, the warmth, and so forth) and on this view, the object truly does have both kinds of qualities. The color exists “cheek by jowl” with the shape. Using some technical terms, we might say that on this view, shape and color are both irreducible qualities; they are basic and appear as they really are. In contrast, as we will see, other versions of Realism will deny color exists as such a basic quality. Instead, such views will reduce color to something more basic.
The motivation for Non-Reductive Realism, otherwise known as Primitivism, is clear enough, namely to allow us to take seriously our common sense view of the world, in which color plays an obvious and significant role. But as we have said, the scientific view of reality threatens common sense. On many fronts, science tells us to be suspicious of our everyday, common beliefs. When it comes to color, science typically seeks to explain our experiences of color by invoking scientifically respectable properties, the ones that lend themselves to mathematization, namely the primary qualities. In schematic form, we are said to perceive red, for instance, because of the shape and texture of a given object, which in turn reflects certain wavelengths of light to our eyes, which then send electrical impulses to our brain, resulting in the experience of color. More generally, the thought is that we should attribute to physical objects only those properties necessary and sufficient to explain their physical behavior, and that this can be accomplished by reference solely to the so-called primary qualities (hence their status as “primary”.) Since the property of red, for instance, seems to play no causal role in our experience of red, it should not be included in the list of properties that characterize physical objects. What does the explaining instead is the texture of the object, the wavelengths of light that are reflected, and so forth. Worse still, even if objects were colored in the irreducible, or what we could call the occurrent sense, it is not clear how that would help our perception of red objects. For again, the mechanism used to explain the perception of red makes use only of light, surface texture and the like. Color is left as explanatorily idle and should not be said to be part of the physical world. So goes the threat from science, as we have said.
How might the Non-Reductive Realist reply? One strategy denies that CS and PS are truly incompatible. Each might be argued to be true in their own way, and that therefore no problem arises. Why? Because 1) common sense and physics, and thus CS and PS respectively, operate at different levels of analysis and 2) there is no ultimately right level of analysis, and so, 3) we are not forced to choose between them. Consider another area where we do not feel the need to choose one level of analysis over another. For instance, we accept explanations of people’s behavior by describing their beliefs and desires. Even though we suspect that those beliefs and desires could (eventually) be given a description at the level of brain processes, we do not think we must appeal to that level in order to genuinely describe and explain. So too a level of discourse that speaks of objects’ irreducible properties seems autonomous and respectable, even if there is another level according to which there are not such colors. The autonomy of this level then could withstand the encroaching scientific perspective, allowing us to maintain both, if we like.
Of course, someone who takes science’s dictates to be the ultimate word on what does really exist—that science is the measure of all that is, will not be swayed by these considerations. And for those philosophers, they now must face that conflict between common sense and science. But again there is possibility for reconciliation. This, however, requires a reinterpretation of the claim that objects are colored, one that makes use of the notion of reduction.
Since the Modern era, scientifically-inclined philosophers have sought a way to reconcile common sense claims with the philosophic-scientific view that color plays no role in physical explanations, should not be countenanced as basic, and thus is not in the objects in a basic sense. Faced with the inadequacies of Non-Reductive Realism, and with the general sentiment that our ontology should be given by science (or at least not be inconsistent with our best scientific theory), we might seek a scientifically respectable account of red and the like.
The hope has been to give a scientific account of these qualities by showing them to be just complicated physical properties, that is, primary qualities. If we can show how color is really just a combination of say, complex, microphysical properties that characterize the surface of objects, ones that cause certain wavelengths to be reflected, we will have given an account of their nature comparable to what has been done with observable shape, size, weight, texture, motion and the like. Objects can be now said to be colored, where that color now is understood as really just a complex of physical, primary, properties. We will have reduced color to properties and relations that do not include occurrent or basic color.
Our original conflict, then between:
CS: Objects are colored
PS: Basic scientific objects are not colored
disappears as CS is reinterpreted to mean that objects are colored in a reduced, non-occurrent sense. Just as scientists have shown sound to be nothing more than wavelengths in a medium, and shown heat to be kinetic energy, a similar reduction has been proposed for color.
How exactly does this reduction go? One broad strategy, known as Physicalism, seeks to reduce color to those physical properties (primary qualities) sufficient to explain why we see objects as colored in the basic, self-presenting, occurrent sense. But saying we can give a reductionist account of color that appeals only to the physical properties of objects and light is far from actually doing it. And there are many obstacles to the actual reduction. Here is why, in part: There are many, many different physical causes which, when they impinge upon our highly sensitive visual system, yield the same experienced color. Consider the color blue, and the many places blue appears. It turns out there are drastically different physical causes for the blue of sapphire; the blue of lapis; that of turquoise; from blue dye to blue in the rainbow; the blue of water compared with the sky; the blue on tv, compared with the blue of a bluish star. In short, identity or even similarity in color of objects does not imply similarity in physical structure of object. (Making matters worse, similarity in physical structure does not even imply similar color appearances. The same reflected range of light, but at different angles of reflection, will make for different colors—this is part of the explanation of the phenomenon of iridescence).
For simplicity, let us ignore the differing physical mechanisms that explain the blue of the sky (dispersal of light), the blue of water (reflection), and the blue of a rainbow (refraction). Instead, just focus on the blue of ordinary objects. Can we give a reductive, physicalist account of this blue, one that allows us to say the object is blue, but in a non-basic way? Here is how one version of Physicalism goes. (We have referred to this as “Reductive Physicalism, but as we are noting now, this is but one of various forms of that approach. We might think of the version about to be discussed as Disjunctive Reductive Physicalism.) A given color is defined by reference to the (micro)physical features that characterize the surfaces of objects; features which are then responsible for reflecting particular wavelengths to perceivers’ eyes. What is a color then? It is that complicated set of primary qualities which characterize the surface of an object. Some surfaces are structured to cause experience of red, some to cause blue, and so forth. The color itself, of an object, is that surface structure, which can be accounted for in physical terms—that is, describable by physics, chemistry and the like.
An immediate problem arises, even for this simplified phenomenon. This is the phenomenon known as metamerism, according to which different combinations of wavelengths (in the same conditions) give rise to identical color experiences. The reason metamers make things difficult is that two objects can have very different surface textures—at the microphysical level—and thus can reflect very different wavelengths to perceivers. But these very different wavelengths can be experienced as the exactly same color. For instance, light that is 100% 577nm (a nanometer is a billionth of a meter) will appear as pure yellow. But light that is composed of 50% 540nm and 50% 670nm will appear qualitatively indistinguishable. Since different physical structures can produce different wavelengths, all of which yield the same color experience, it appears we are left defining color as the structure of an object by saying:
Yellow= microstructure1 OR microstructure2 OR microstructure3 OR…
This is, in other words, a disjunction and yellow looks to be definable as a disjunction only. There is apparently no single physical property of objects, of wavelengths, of reflections of light, and so forth. that all yellow objects have in common—let alone yellow of non-ordinary objects like the sun, after-images, and so forth.
With these scientific facts in hand we approach the matter now as philosophers. What should we say about the reduction of a property, in this case, a color, to a disjunction? Consider various problems raised. First, if the list of conditions that characterize yellow (or any color) is infinite, as it might be, then it hardly seems that we have reduced color. Even were it just a long finite list, as seems equally possible, we also might object to the claim that such disjunctive properties are real properties at all. Most troubling, however, is that there does not seem to be a unifying physical condition which explains why these all are instances of yellow. The only thing that explains why these various physical conditions are yellow is that they cause experiences of yellow. Thus our seemingly perceiver-independent account of color actually seems to require reference to perceivers. For without perceivers of color in the picture, we no way to explain why some physical conditions are yellow and some are not. And that leaves us with the disturbing sense that our list of physical conditions is just a hodgepodge, a gerrymandered set of properties, not a genuine explanatorily useful reduction. And while there are other ways to develop such Physicalism, the problems we have outlined have sufficed to send philosophers looking elsewhere for an account.
Failing to find a single (micro)property that explains an experience of a certain color, while still hoping to reconcile the claim that objects are colored with the scientific claim that color is not basic, philosophers have hit upon another reductive strategy. John Locke is usually credited here as the originator of this Dispositionalism, as he writes,
“Such qualities, which in truth are nothing in the Objects themselves, but Powers to produce various Sensations in us by their primary qualities, that is, by the Bulk, Figure, Texture, and Motion of their insensible parts, as Colours, Sounds, Tastes, and so forth. These I call secondary qualities.” (Locke, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Bk.II, Chpt. VIII, §10.)
To appreciate this claim, recall that we are still looking for a reductive account of color, but as well, have rejected Physicalist attempts at reduction. With that in mind, we might step back and notice that the Physicalist account of color was given by focusing largely, if not completely, on the object itself, leaving aside our experience of color—what it is like and how it might play a role in understanding color. Perhaps the absence of even a reference to experience is the source of the trouble. For certainly our motivation to understand color itself comes from reflection on our experience of color—especially as we put that alongside an account of reality that tells us to be suspicious of our common sense experiences of the world. Maybe we will do better by approaching the nature of color with a role for the fact that color is an experienced quality. With this in mind, we might develop an account of color that brings out the extent to which the particular nature of color is linked with experiences of color, though the color itself is still said to be a property of objects.
To develop this account, philosophers draw attention to the following true biconditional:
(C): x is red if and only if x appears red under standard conditions.
Red objects, that is, appear red in standard conditions (to normal perceivers), and if an object appears red to a normal perceiver, in normal conditions, then that object is red. What explains this? Here it is claimed that C is true because of a deeper truth about color, namely, that the color of an object just is the disposition of that object to appear red. Let us call this DC, and let it be the Dispositionalist’s definition of color.
(DC): x is red = x is disposed to appear red (to normal perceivers in standard conditions).
Of course, there are also corresponding biconditionals for shapes of objects. Examination of their different status will make clearer the goal and nature of Dispositionalism. Consider then,
(S): x is square iff x appears square under standard conditions (to normal perceivers)
This too is true, but does not entail a parallel treatment of square’s essence. For we will not accept,
(DS): x is square = x is disposed to appear square (to normal perceivers in standard conditions).
The reason we will not move from S to DS is instructive. For when it comes to such properties as being square, we believe that an account of its nature can be given by simple appeal to an objects’ physical properties, without appeal to how it appears to perceivers. We have no temptation to give a dispositionalist account of square for the essence of square. In contrast, color can be thought of as a property of physical objects, but only in a thin sense, namely, the disposition to cause in us certain experiences. Which experience? The appearance of the very color in question.
The merits of this account are numerous. First, we have found a way to keep our common sense claim, CS from above, though with a reinterpretation of CS. Objects are colored, though not in a basic sense. Second, we now also have room to take seriously the dictates of science according to which the basic entities of reality are not colored. What we can say is that if those basic entities are put together in suitable ways, ordinary objects come to have certain powers or dispositions, namely in this case, to cause experience of colors such as red. This makes for another merit. Objects can said to be red, or blue, and so forth, and we can distinguish veridical from non-veridical perceptions of color. One might experience a truly blue object as green, because either the viewing conditions are not standard (for instance, in certain kinds of light), or because something is amiss with the perceiver. In the second case, the perception was not veridical, for there is a way the object really is colored. This allows, in other words, for intersubjective agreement about the colors of objects, and thus keeps color from being purely subjective or relative. Finally, we can say that objects do have their colors even when not being observed, or even when they are in the dark. For even in the dark, objects do have the disposition to appear certain ways, and of course, that is what we are saying color really is. In this way color is said to be real, as we want when considering the matter from common sense. Yet in another sense, color is relative to a perceiver—for an object only has a disposition to appear red—and the experience of red, for instance, does require a perceiver, and an element of subjectivity. The total package then is a nice blend of objective and subjective elements, and for many is just what we should expect from a good explanation of color.
In sum, these features have made Dispositionalism a tempting and popular position. We now explore some objections to this view, leaving it to the reader to decide for themselves whether or not these objections are compelling.
It is often complained against Dispositionalism, for instance, that colors do not look like dispositions. They look like basic, occurrent properties, just like the shapes of objects. How then, it is questioned, could color really be a disposition, if it does not look like one at all? Here we might expect the Dispositionalist to ask us to specify exactly how we would expect a disposition to look in the first place. The Dispositionalist will then argue that once we actually figure out how we would expect color as disposition to appear, we discover that that is just how colors do appear. For example, if color were a disposition to appear red in standard conditions, then in standard conditions, a red object would look red. And is not that just what it does look like?
Perhaps more troubling, however, is that Dispositionalism seems circular. What is red? A disposition to appear a certain way. Which way? To appear as red, of course. Red, then, is a disposition to appear red. If “red” is being used the same way here, then we have explained “red” by reference to “appears red”. That seems straightforwardly circular, and thus problematic. Interestingly, some philosophers have taken this to be a serious problem, while others have suggested it is a harmless and even expected result. After all, they say, we have wanted an account of color that appeals to our experience of it. Thus the only way to explain what red is is to describe our experiences of red. In this case the circularity is not threatening, but simply an indication that our desired account of color required appeal to the experience of color to make sense of it in the first place. That, again, was what made explanation of red different from explanation of shape. On the other hand, circular accounts do not provide much information, and as such we might still wonder what we have really learned about the nature of red, if that is just a disposition to appear red.
Finally, some have worried that if color is a disposition, we are now incapable of explaining why we have experiences of color at all. Consider this parallel. We can taste the saltiness of a pretzel. Why? Because the pretzel was salty. And the salt has a disposition to dissolve and cause experiences of tasting salty. But it is not the disposition to dissolve that is responsible for the taste of salt. It is the non-dispositional properties of salt that both cause it to dissolve and which cause the taste of salt. Again, it is not salt’s dispositions that cause our experiences of salty taste. It is the non-dispositional properties that ground that disposition. In fact, we say that what is essential to salt is whatever properties explain those dispositions, and it is those more basic properties that do the causing. So too it might be said for color. Dispositions do not cause anything, but rather the ground of those dispositions does. Color as a disposition cannot cause a perception of color. Instead, it must be the non-dispositional ground that causes experiences of color. But that means we have located color in the wrong place. Instead of speaking of color as a disposition, it now seems we should be considering the ground of that disposition to be the heart of color. And that might take us away from Dispositionalism and back to Physicalism, with all of its problems. Or maybe not, as some philosophers have sought here a third way.
As noted, these discussions of different kinds of Realism have only skimmed the surface. The broad strategies we have outlined, of course, can and have been developed in quite a number of different ways. Enough has been said, however, to both give a sense of these positions and to show the need some have felt for a completely different approach. We turn to that now, the broad strategy we have designated as Subjectivism.
Recall that conflict between science and common sense over the status of color.
CS: Ordinary objects are colored.
PS: Basic scientific objects are not colored.
Our discussion of Realism has been an extended exploration of this conflict, with focus on preserving the truth of CS and common sense. Let us now cease attempting to reconcile these claims, and simply reject CS as false. Common sense is just wrong, we might claim. Objects are not colored in any sense, reduced or not; and thus we are free to embrace a scientific ontology which does not include color among the basic properties of its basic entities.
Common sense is wrong then, but it certainly does not seem wrong. The world presents itself as colored, afterall, and if it really is not colored, we are owed at least an explanation of how we could have been so wrong. Here is where Subjectivism gets its name and appeal. For while the world itself has no color, there are undeniably experiences of color. And while we will need to give a philosophical account of those experiences, we can say for now that color is subjective in the sense of being perceiver dependent, just as pain is. Objects can be round or square, but they are not colored. Since it does not make sense to say objects have the properties of pain and pleasure, we say that pain and pleasure, instead, are merely types of subjective experience. Those experiences may be caused by physical objects, but the qualities of pain and pleasure are in us, not in the objects. So too we may say for color.
In thus locating color within perceptual experience, we make it perceiver dependent, and thus, in some sense, cease to view color as part of the objective world. How we choose to account for experience itself, however, will give us different versions of Subjectivism.
Let us call any position that posits color as a genuine property of subjective, personal experience, a version of Mentalism. The inspiration for this view is René Descartes, who thought that color and other secondary qualities were merely sensations, and as such, mere occurrences within a mental substance. The parallel again with pain is instructive here. Pain and color, then, occur in a substance that is also the locus of thinking. As occurrences in a mental realm, they fall outside the scope of the physical sciences that study material substance.
Contemporary philosophy, however, has had little sympathy for this kind of substance dualism, whereby two distinct types of substances exist side by side. Not only does this mental substance fall outside the scope of the physical sciences, difficult questions about the connection and interaction of these independent substances arise. As we will see next, some have left the letter of mental substance behind, while retaining the spirit in a related, but slightly less problematic metaphysics, one that comes in handy when accounting for the nature of color.
In the earlier parts of the twentieth century, philosophers made much use of a special class of entities dubbed, sense-data. These are a class of particulars, or individuals, which have existence only in minds. They are often held to be private, special objects, of which each person has direct, infallible access to and knowledge of. Knowledge of sense-data in turn allegedly provided foundational knowledge on which all other knowledge rests. As for sense-data themselves, they were introduced to explain the appearance of perceptual qualities when there were in fact no such qualities in the physical objects one is perceiving. In a famous example, one could explain a perception of an elliptical coin, when presented with a coin that is really round, by claiming that the actual object of experience is an elliptically-shaped item (an elliptical sensum), which one experienced directly. Sense-data would be the bearers of properties we take physical objects to have, and so could explain the possibility of perceptual error.
With this metaphysics in hand, color can now be categorized as a property of such sense-data. Though the physical world may lack such properties as color, the world causes each of us to have experiences and present in such experiences would be special, private, mental entities that have the qualities in question. Presented then with an apple that really is not red or sweet, we have experiences of red sensa; sweet sensa, and so forth. We thereby account for the existence of such qualities—having them qualify these subjective, perceiver dependent entities, and we also explain our belief that the world is colored. We think there is color, because in fact there is, though we mistakenly believe the color of sense-data is really to be found in physical objects.
Sense-data themselves, however, have fallen on hard times, especially since the middle of the twentieth century as various philosophers objected both to their nature and the epistemological role they were to play. Though many are now reluctant to speak of sense-data as a class of particulars, some contemporary philosophers have preserved some of the functions of sense-data, and now speak of qualities that characterize our visual field, or perhaps that qualify our mental states or mental events. Color on this understanding is categorized as a “phenomenal property”, maintaining the Cartesian legacy that such properties are mind-dependent and subjective, but in a way that frees them of excessive ontological baggage.
In opposition to Mentalism, but still within what we have called Subjectivism, lies another popular position, Eliminativism. This view agrees that objects are not colored, but it does not wish to trade the color of objects for color as now an irreducible property of something inner or mental. Instead, it wishes to rob color of any ontological significance at all. We can still speak of our experiencing color, of course, but we are not to understand this as claiming that color does really exist, only now as a property of mental substance or of sense-data or of our visual field. Color experiences themselves, we could say, are to be reduced to non-color properties, just as Reductive Physicalism sought to reduce the color of objects to non-colored properties and relations. For Eliminativism the reduction of color experiences is to be to properties and facts about our visual processing systems, facts about the behavior of rods and cones, about transmission of information along neural pathways and the like. (We will explore some of the details below in our discussion of the universality of color experience.) In the end, nothing, anywhere, answers to our common sense description or account of color. That type of property just does not exist.
Put positively, Eliminativism can be understood as follows. Our experience of a seemingly colored world is the result of a systematic error. Simply put, we take features found in our visual experience and project them upon the world, mistakenly believing that color is “out there”—when in fact color is but subjective response to an achromatic reality. This Projectivism about color does not deny that this is an important projection, or that it might help us navigate the world more easily, or that we can continue to speak of the world as colored, but it does point out the fundamental error nevertheless. An analogy might help, and in fact much recent philosophy has involved discussion of the aptness of the following analogy.
In ordinary moral discourse, we are inclined to speak of an action as moral or immoral, right or wrong. We seem in these cases to be claiming that a particular act has (or lacks) a special, moral property or nature. Taken literally, though, such predication would commit us to the existence of rather strange properties, that is, rightness and/or wrongness, ones that are not easily described or explained. Wanting to avoid commitment to those properties, some have suggested a similar projectivist account. In this case, certain actions create in us feelings of pleasure or pain, approval or disapproval. We project these attitudes upon the world, taking the world to really have such properties, when in fact they are nothing but subjective responses. (Talk of “projection” in the psychoanalytic sense is another helpful parallel, where again, something “inner” is mistakenly claimed to be found “outside” us.)
Such Projectivism, as one way of developing Eliminativism, clears the road for a fully scientific account not only of objects, but now of perceivers as well. In particular, only properties that can do genuine explanatory work will be included, and color will be sorted into the group of properties that contribute nothing to our understanding of causal relations between objects and perceivers. There is a downside, however. Besides indicting common sense as systematically wrong, we are bound to be left with a nagging feeling that a most treasured property has completely disappeared. This has provoked some to reply along the following lines: “We started with a belief that objects are colored. Having reduced physical objects to items with only primary qualities, we were left to relocate color and similar qualities within perceivers. Now, however, we have made perceivers and their experiences also bereft of secondary qualities. Without color in the picture at all, we fail to explain how we thought there was color in the first place. How can we explain the appearance of color, our experience of color, now that color is nowhere to be found?”
This question might lead one to rethink the steps that led to this puzzling conclusion, and to raise the possibility that a mistake was made along the way. If so, where exactly did we go wrong, and what would be a better route? If not, how exactly then do we come to believe there is color, if it appears nowhere in our account of reality and perceivers? These difficult questions explain why philosophers continue to debate this interplay between what common sense says about color and what science would have us believe.
One should not conclude that the only philosophical questions about color involve science. The remaining portions of this article offer introduction to other important and exciting issues. In particular, we turn to some questions of metaphysics, and then turn to ones about the universality of color experience, questions that get at the heart of the nature of color from other perspectives.
To begin, consider how much energy we have devoted to explaining the color of objects. Is the color of an object a basic property, a disposition, a combination of micro-primary qualities? Let us pause, however, and ask about color itself. What exactly is color in the first place? What is the essence of this quality that is capable of being a property of objects, or a property of sensations, and so forth? (We can also ask, of course, “What is a quality? And what is the difference between qualities that are colors and those that are sounds?) Focusing our attention on a specific color seems to make things even harder. Consider the questions, “What is the essence of red?” “What is the difference between red and blue”? How do we even go about answering them? Let us explore some attempts.
Faced with such as question as, “What is the essence of red?” one might respond by pointing to something red, or by looking for a metaphor, claiming that red is like a trumpet sound. The first does not tell us much though—in fact, pointing at a red ball does not suffice to even indicate the redness as opposed to the round shape. Similarly, though metaphors might help convey something about the experience of red, they tell us little about the nature of redness. Can we do better? Can we actually articulate the nature of individual colors? Can we even say what colors in general are, in a rich, philosophically satisfying manner?
One possible source of the apparent difficulty is that we tend to think that the red we experience is something essentially private and subjective. We are drawn to a picture whereby the essence of red, or blue, or yellow for that matter, is given in sense-experience, where the experience itself is something ineffable. Just as it is hard, if not impossible, to articulate what a pain feels like, we may think that the qualitative difference between blue and red is similarly inexpressible. Let “color skepticism” be the view that the essence of color is ineffable, and let us explore the merits of such skepticism.
One source of the supposed ineffability of color, as we have seen, lies in the belief that color’s nature is revealed only in private experience. The language of color, and language as a whole, however, is public in the sense of both being suitable for reporting public events and learnable by appeal to public objects. How then could the allegedly private, subjective nature of color be reconciled with the public, intersubjective nature of language? Color skepticism gains a foothold here, for it seems it cannot. As a result, we are tempted to conclude that our experiences of color are akin to pain in being private, personal and ineffable. No surprise that many have been led to wonder whether the qualitative experience they associate with, say, red, is the same for each person, or instead, whether it is possible that what I experience as red, you experience as green, though we both use the same public word, “red”. Such color skepticism leads to this familiar problem, the Inverted Spectrum. At its worst, we imagine that all of our color experiences might be systematically different from another’s, though we all use “red” to refer to the color of firetrucks, “yellow” for the color of bananas, and so forth. In this case, each of us is trapped within our minds, forever cut-off from truly sharing our experiences of things that matter dearly to us.
How we might extricate ourselves from this depressing, solipsistic trap? One route is to rethink our starting point, namely that there is nothing more to say about red than pointing to red objects or reverting to metaphor. As an alternative, some have sought to articulate the metaphysical nature of color in a surprising direction—by understanding the intrinsic features of individual colors as a product of their relations to other colors. These relations are known as “internal relations” and to them we turn.
First we need to distinguish such internal relations from so-called external relations. External relations are ones in which the relation plays no role in making the relata the relata that they are. For instance, my glass of water is externally related to the table. The relation, “being on top of” is external in that it is not part of the nature or essence of the glass or table to be in that relation. Were the glass and table to cease to being so related neither will undergo a change in their nature. They will not cease to be the things they are. The relata here are external to each other in the sense of not depending on each, or the relation, for their identity.
In contrast we have internal relations. For internal relations, the relations are essential to the being and nature of the related items. Without that particular relation, an entity would not be the thing that it is. To say that colors are internally related to colors would mean that the natures of individual colors depend on the relations those colors have to other colors, to other members the color-array. Orange is related to red and yellow in a particular, unique way, for instance. That relation therefore helps make orange the color it is—that relation as well as the other ones that orange bears to other colors. No other color has those particular relations, and thus no other color is orange. Put differently, orange would cease to be orange were it to not have that relational structure to other colors. (Another example is numbers. Seven would not be the number it is, for instance, were it not between 6 and 8.)
To speak then of a particular color requires reference to its relational place within a color array. What is the nature of the relation between colors? Most abstractly, it is that relation which includes only colors. More specifically, we might say that it is the betweenness relation colors bear to one another. Orange, for instance, is between yellow and red, while green is between blue and yellow, and so forth. Such betweenness relations capture the essence of color. Taken as a whole, these complex betweenness relations can be modeled, allowing us to understand the logical structure of the entire color array. And though many models have been proposed, one particularly illuminating one captures these betweenness relations by modeling color’s structure on that of a double cone. (We can even now speak of the difference between different types of qualities by talking about their different spatial models—color is nicely modeled on a double cone, sound perhaps by a spiral staircase, with each octave recognized as another turn on the staircase.)
The following diagram helps illustrate the structure of color, making use of the HSL (hue, saturation, lightness) model. We can even use it to spell out in some detail a claim about a particular color’s nature and its betweenness relations.
Relying as we have on internal relations might seem paradoxical. On the one hand, each color has its proper place within the color array because of the particular color it is. On the other a color is the particular color it is because of that place within the color array. This suggests colors have their intrinsic properties because of their relations—as opposed to saying they have the relations they do because of their intrinsic property. But what could be plainer than saying red is what it is because of its intrinsic properties? The intrinsic nature of color, we might object, is prior to any of its relations and it is that essence we should try to articulate. Have not we forgotten this important point? Have not we ignored the intrinsic nature of color, and thus what is most important about color in the first place? In reply, it is acknowledged that this account of internal relations does appeal to the relations a color has to other colors in order to individuate it. But, crucially, that does not make the relations conceptually or ontologically prior to colors’ intrinsic properties. For to make sense of the particular relations a color has we have to return to the relata, the color itself. A color has the particular relations it does because of the color it is, just as we want to say. The difference is that on this story, the relata and the relation are intimately and necessarily involved. The relationship and dependence goes in both directions. We are talking about internal relations here, after all. As such, the relata and the relation figure as essential elements. Both balance each other, making both important, but neither prior. That is what is so special about internal relations. In conclusion, we can now say that we have still paid proper respect to the intrinsic nature color.
With this account in place, perhaps we finally have an answer to the color skeptic. We now have something, in fact a lot, to say about each color. True, we need to speak of other colors to explain what a single color is, but we have gone well beyond mere pointing or metaphor. We say what a color is by talking about how it relates to other colors, about its color relationships, its intrinsic properties that make for those relations, and those relations that make for those properties. If that is not good enough to satisfy our skeptic, we might begin to wonder whether the skeptic is willing to be convinced.
A final issue we will discuss in this article concerns the universality of color experience. We have already seen one threat to the notion that we all experience color the same way, namely the possibility of an inverted spectrum. A deeper threat comes from another direction, this time borne from wondering about the connection between language and perception. An important theme in the background of this threat lies in the rise and development of a view according to which our perceptual experience is mediated by our language. This has been an important strand in post-WWII philosophy, and as such draws on various themes that fall far outside the scope of this article. We can gain enough of an appreciation of the issue by considering for starters a relatively uncontroversial sense in which our familiarity with a concept influences what we see. To use a well-worn example, a physicist looking at a technical apparatus in a lab sees, in some sense, something different that what the layperson sees and experiences. In this way, different concepts can play some role in what is seen. We move from this innocuous example to tougher ones when we wonder whether different cultures that have completely different languages experience the same world. Or, instead, do the different linguistic resources they bring to experience give them experiences of quite different worlds? It is not hard to be swayed to a perspective from which we see such different languages as yielding very different worlds of experience. Now take these general questions and apply them to experiences of color. Would speakers of languages that have different color terms see the world differently, see different colors?
A particularly strong version of the view that language influences perception was advanced by the anthropologists, Whorf and Sapir. On their view, language plays such an essential role in perception that cultures that use different language can be said to inhabit quite different worlds. What we all see, what we take ourselves to touch, to conceive as real, is a function of language. Vary the language and you change the world experienced. Dubbed the thesis of Linguistic Determinism, this view clearly has interesting implication for color experience once it is realized that there is great diversity in color language across cultures. There are well-documented languages that have only 2 color terms, or three, or only four, and so forth.
What then would Linguistic Determinism have us expect for people who speak a language with only three color terms, for instance? Presumably, if that thesis of determinism is correct, those people would experience only three colors. We would expect these people to simply not be aware of the colors we have terms for; they would fail to make the color discriminations we make, and they would organize their color field in very different ways than we do. This hypothesis was put to the test in the 1960’s by the researchers, Berlin and Kay. Compiling data from a great number of languages, their results seem to contradict the Whorf-Sapir thesis and open a whole range of questions and interesting debates
To help appreciate the significance of their findings, we need to distinguish a color’s “foci” from its “boundary.” When presented with an array of color samples (such as ones found at a paint store) we can ask how many of those samples are properly called by a certain color. We could ask, that is, how many of these samples are appropriately called “red”, and where do we draw the line between samples that are red and those that are not? To answer these questions is to speak of the red’s boundary. We might also ask about what is the best sample or paradigmatic sample of red. This is to ask about red’s foci, or more generally, to look for focal samples.
Berlin and Kay found, quite interestingly, that though there are differences across cultures of color boundaries for shared color terms, there was significant consensus on what counted as a focal color—even across languages with very different numbers of color terms. So, in a culture that had only three basic color words, say ones for “white”, “black”, and “red”, people in that culture would point to the same samples as the foci for each of these colors as people with 11 basic color terms, such as English speakers. What they consider as truly red, or white, or black, would be nearly the same samples that we do, though we carve up the world with many different color terms. On the face of it, this suggests something quite other than Whorf-Sapir would have us expect. Something besides color vocabulary seems to be at work in our experience of color. Why else would we all gravitate to the same samples, when for some what is red would presumably include many more colors than us? After all, with only three terms to cover the whole range of color, many more things would have to be called “white” or “black” or “red” in this example. Why would certain samples stand out, even when so many other things are conceived and experienced as red?
In addition, Berlin and Kay found that languages exhibit great similarities on which color terms they have; and great similarities in the relationships between differing numbers of color terms. The following graph summarizes their results, where movement from left to right indicates what color terms would be added as a language increases its number of terms.
Here we see that if a language has two color terms, the terms are “white” and “black”. If a language has a third term, it is “red”; if more than three, then either “green” or “yellow”; and next the other “green” or “yellow” term; and so on. This suggests, as they interpreted it, a development suitably conceived as evolutionary. Thus if a language evolves from two colors to three, the one it will add will be “red”, then “green or “yellow”, and so forth.
What is the philosophical significance of these findings, if true? Simply put, they again suggest that there is something other than language that determines what colors are seen. Berlin and Kay conclude that there are universal, non-trivial constraints on color terms. Color experience is not simply a function of a language’s terms and arbitrary conventions. Instead, there seems something about how the world is that causes different speakers to experience certain colors as best samples, to develop terms for “red” before terms for “brown”, for privileging “white” and “black” over “pink”, and so forth.
If not language, what would explain these findings? One answer comes from facts about the biology of color perception, facts about how our visual system processes certain kinds of electromagnetic radiation, that is, light. (These are the very facts our previously discussed “color-eliminativist” might offer to show that there really is no such thing as color, that is, might make use of to reduce color experience to facts, properties, and relations that make no mention of color at all. Thus what follows can be called upon to serve two functions—explain similarity of color experience across language, and also be used by a color eliminativist to reduce away color. Importantly, these issues are logically independent, and a solution to one problem need have no bearing on the truth of the other.)
Here is a quick summary of the proposed biological account. Our visual system includes rods and cones. Cones are responsible for color vision and do so with three different types of cones. Two of these cones operate according to what is known as opponent-processing. For these two types of cones, they each have two cells, one which has its rate of firing increase when hit by a certain range of light and decrease when another range of light hits it, and a second cell that operates just the opposite way. For example, there is a cell that maximizes its output when hit by light around 610nm and is at its lowest output around 500nm. It sits alongside another cell that works just the opposite—its maximum is around 500nm and its lowest is at 610nm. (Call these our Y+B- and Y-B+ cells, respectively.) Thus when the cone with this cell package is hit by that 610nm light, there will be a pure, highly stimulated response as the Y+B- cell will be at its highest, and the Y-B+ cell will be at its quietist. 610nm happens to be the range of light we call yellow; and thus when this cone is hit by that light, it will give its purest, most intense output of energy. Yellow will be experienced, in other words, in a pure, intense manner. But when the received light is at around 440nm, this Y+B- cell is at its lowest output, but its partner, the Y-B+ cell, is at its highest output. Blue then also can appear as a particularly strong, pure color. Other places where we get these pure peaks of cell stimulation occur at 520nm and 660nm—the very ranges that correspond to green and red respectively. Here we can speak of our R-G+ and R+G- cells. (White and black have their own cells, but these do not work in opposition to each other, so both the black cell and the white cell can be activated at the same time, yielding experiences of different shades of gray.)
This all suggest that any person with a normal operating visual system is going to experience certain ranges of light with intense neural stimulation which happen to correspond to the four basic colors: yellow, red, blue, and green (yes, green is a primary color when it considering our visual system.) And it also explains why no one seems to experience reddish greens—for when the “red” cell is active, the “green” cell is not. We can only have one or the other, and not both. Further, these facts might be able to explain why different speakers in different languages hone in on the same color samples—because for everyone these samples trigger the same intense cell stimulation. Our shared judgments about focal colors, as well as why all people gravitate towards certain colors in a similar order, now seem explainable. And the explanation goes beyond what language creates, contrary to Whorf-Sapir.
To be sure, there are many questions left—such as why it is that red always is the first color to appear in languages after “white” and “black” even though other colors trigger similarly intense responses. So too have Berlin/Kay’s results been subjected to many criticisms and objections, from the philosophical to the methodological. What emerges then is a fascinating debate the ranges across numerous disciplines. In a way, that seems most proper and fitting. For color appeals to all who can see it, and it makes sense to suppose that we are still drawn to color, whatever our intellectual interests, just as we have been since we were kids.
Eric M. Rubenstein
Indiana University of Pennsylvania
U. S. A.
Last updated: June 8, 2006 | Originally published: