Comparative philosophy—sometimes called “cross-cultural philosophy”—is a subfield of philosophy in which philosophers work on problems by intentionally setting into dialogue sources from across cultural, linguistic, and philosophical streams. The ambition and challenge of comparative philosophy is to include all the philosophies of global humanity in its vision of what is constituted by philosophy.
This approach distinguishes comparative philosophy from several other approaches to philosophy. First, comparative philosophy is distinct from both area studies philosophy (in which philosophers investigate topics in particular cultural traditions, for example, Confucianism) and world philosophy (in which philosophers construct a philosophical system based on the fullness of global traditions of thought). Second, comparative philosophy differs from more traditional philosophy in which ideas are compared among thinkers within a particular tradition; comparative philosophy intentionally compares the ideas of thinkers of very different traditions, especially culturally distinct traditions.
With the unique approach of comparative philosophy also comes unique difficulties and challenges that are not as characteristic of doing philosophy within a particular tradition. Such difficulties to be avoided include descriptive chauvinism (recreating another tradition in the image of one’s own), normative skepticism (merely narrating or describing the views of different philosophers and traditions, suspending all judgment about their adequacy), incommensurability (the inability to find the common ground among traditions needed as a basis for comparison), and perennialism (failure to realize that philosophical traditions evolve, that they are not perennial in the sense of being monolithic or static). Furthermore, since comparative philosophy involves an approach that is not dominant in academic philosophy, it has been somewhat neglected by the mainstream of the profession. However, comparative philosophy is fairly early in its developmental stages.
Comparative philosophy—sometimes called cross-cultural philosophy—is a subfield of philosophy in which philosophers work on problems by intentionally setting into dialogue sources from across cultural, linguistic, and philosophical streams. Comparative philosophers most frequently engage topics in dialogue between modern Western (for example, American and Continental European) and Classical Asian (for example, Chinese, Indian, or Japanese) traditions, but work has been done using materials and approaches from Islamic and African philosophical traditions as well as from classical Western traditions (for example, Judaism, Christianity, Platonism).
It is important to distinguish comparative philosophy from both area studies philosophy and world philosophy. Unlike comparative philosophy, in area studies philosophy, the focus is on a single region. Chinese philosophy, Indian philosophy, and African philosophy are examples of area studies philosophy fields, in which the work done need not be comparative. Area studies philosophers do not necessarily compare the texts and thinkers with which they work with any ideas outside of the circumscribed area. For example, Chinese philosophers may study Confucius, various forms of Confucianism, criticisms of Confucianism in Chinese Daoism and Buddhism, and even Confucianism in the contemporary world, but they need not make any attempt to compare Confucian thought with philosophical texts and thinkers from other cultures. (For this reason, the bibliography to the present entry does not have categories that fit area studies philosophy rather than comparative philosophy.)
World philosophy, like area studies philosophy, should be distinguished from comparative philosophy. World philosophy may be thought of as an effort at constructive philosophy that takes into account the great variety of philosophical writings and traditions across human cultures and endeavors to weave them into a coherent world view. As such, it is an extension of comparative philosophy, because comparison is fundamental to the constructivist task. But comparative philosophy need not become world philosophy. The comparative philosopher may be working on isolated topics, or with two or more philosophers, just for the sake of gaining clarity on some specific issue. Likewise, those wanting to construct a world philosophy often find a place for the thought of other traditions in the system they construct, but it is fair to wonder whether they really allow the voice of the other to express itself in its strongest form.
Comparative philosophy as cross-cultural philosophy is a relative newcomer to the field of philosophy. It has its antecedents in the Western awareness of different traditions, especially Asian ones, in the eighteenth century. Much of the work done during this period and just afterward does not conform to the definition of comparative philosophy outlined above. As Jonathan Spence (1998) has pointed out, the earliest treatments of China by Western philosophers, such as that of Hegel, really cannot properly be called comparative philosophy because they lack any serious engagement from the Chinese side.
The story is quite different in Asia, where cultural traditions mingled and clashed with considerably more frequency than in the relatively provincial West. For instance, the spread of Buddhism into China from India and central Asia beginning in the first few centuries CE sparked a long tradition of philosophical reaction to its “foreign” ideas from Confucian and Daoist intellectuals—much of it hostile, some of it appreciative and appropriating, but all of it at least implicitly comparative. The story of Chinese Buddhism over the next two millennia is very much the story of the dialogue between and among foreign and indigenous traditions, as is the story of Confucianism and Daoism during the same period. Similar patterns of dialogue between indigenous traditions and Buddhism are found in Korea, Japan, Sri Lanka, Thailand and Vietnam; parallel patterns may be identified among other players in India. It is, perhaps, because of this long familiarity with cross-cultural dialogue and the willingness to take one’s partners seriously that many of the earliest works comparing Eastern and Western philosophies that are still important came not from Westerners but from non-Westerners responding to Western ideas. Sri Aurobindo (1872-1950) and Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (1888-1975) were perhaps the most prominent and influential voices responding from India in the early part of the last century, presenting Indian philosophical ideas and comparing, contrasting, and even fusing Eastern and Western philosophy and religion. In Japan, Nishida Kitaro’s An Inquiry into the Good (1911) initiated a creative, critical appropriation of Western philosophy and religion from a perspective anchored in Mahayana Buddhism that continues today in the work of members of the Kyoto School, most notably Keiji Nishitani and Masao Abe.
Partially as a result of the emergence of comparative studies in nineteenth-century Anglo-European intellectual history, the University of Hawaii sponsored the first in a sequence of East-West Philosophers’ Conferences in 1939. Since that time comparative philosophy, area studies philosophy, and world philosophy have continued to grow and cross fertilize each other. Nevertheless, comparative philosophy as a field is only now becoming fully self-conscious, methodologically and substantively, about its role and function in the larger enterprises of philosophy and area studies.
Mainstream Western philosophy has been slow to accept comparative philosophy. Philosophy departments rarely create space for it in their curricula, and comparative philosophers often find it difficult to publish their work in mainline journals. In November of 1996, comparative philosopher Bryan Van Norden wrote an “Open Letter to the APA.” Van Norden complained directly that philosophers writing on comparative subjects were being segregated out of the mainstream philosophical journals. Although Van Norden does not make it entirely clear in his letter, his complaint seems to be directed toward two ways in which scholars of comparative philosophy have been disenfranchised from mainstream journals in the past.
One way in which this has happened is that these scholars must go to area studies journals, such as those dealing with China, India, Asia, the Middle East, or Islam. Another way in which this has happened was that their comparative work was subsumed under area studies philosophy journals such as the Journal of Chinese Philosophy, African Philosophy, Journal of Indian Philosophy, Journal of Jewish Thought and Philosophy, Philosophy in Japan, or Asian Philosophy. The distinctively comparative journals still remain small in number: Philosophy East and West and Dao: A Journal in Comparative Philosophy (which has a restricted area of comparison).
Nevertheless, the Society of Asian and Comparative Philosophy now convenes its own sections in the annual meetings of the American Philosophical, the American Academy of Religion, and the Association of Asian Studies. The Association of Asian Studies also has published a monograph series featuring works in any area of Asian philosophy (or in any other field of philosophy examined from a comparative perspective) since 1974. Some presses, such as the State University of New York Press and Lexington Books also have specific book series devoted to topics in comparative philosophy. Examples of work in these series include Varieties of Ethical Reflection: New Directions for Ethics in a Global Context, edited by Michael Barnhart (2003) and Self as Person in Asian Thought, edited by Roger Ames, Wilmal Dissanayake, and Thomas Kasulis (1994).
Until very recently, most introductory philosophy courses focused exclusively on the Western tradition, indeed mainly on the Anglo-European classics and thinkers. But now there is a much wider variety of work available for introducing students to philosophy that is either explicitly comparative in itself, or that at least makes possible comparative philosophical work. (Some of these works are listed in the bibliography below.)
Martha Nussbaum (1997) warns against several kinds of vices that infect comparative analysis and some of the activities she cautions against may represent the kinds of methodological procedures or dispositions toward belief to which comparative philosophers might fall victim.
Descriptive chauvinism is that fault which consists in recreating the other tradition in the image of one’s own. This is reading a text from another tradition and assuming that it asks the same questions or constructs responses or answers in a similar manner as that one with which one is most familiar. For example, philosophers who read Confucius as a virtue ethicist on the model of Aristotle must be on constant guard against this kind of chauvinism. David Hall and Roger Ames (1995) have argued against translating the name of the Chinese text Zhongyong as The Doctrine of the Mean, because they do not think that it pursues the same kinds of virtue analysis in practical reason that Aristotle does in his Nicomachean Ethics.
On the opposite end, but still an example of a kind of chauvinistic vice, is what Nussbaum calls normative chauvinism. This is the tendency found in many philosophers to believe that their tradition is best and that insofar as the others are different, they are inferior or in error. Ideally, philosophers should hold those views that are most defensible and credible. But the criteria for making this decision may be tradition-dependent. So, if a philosopher is unwilling to revisit his own criteria in light of another tradition, he may find himself committed to little else other than a form of normative chauvinism. For example, finding that Zhuangzi’s antirationalism moves through quietude and stillness to effortless action might lead some philosophers to dismiss this approach because it does not employ the sorts of evidential standards one holds. A common form of normative chauvinism is the belief that unless philosophy is done in a certain kind of way (for example, ratiocinative argument), then it cannot properly be considered philosophy. Many philosophy departments in Europe, Britain, and America have never thought about including courses in comparative philosophy, or even area studies philosophies such as those from China, India, or Japan because these traditions are not perceived as doing “real philosophy.” Some comparative philosophers believe this is analogous to a person listening to Indian music, realizing that it sounds very different from Western music, and concluding that it is not “real music.” What gets overlooked in such cases is that, while the whole concept of a “philosophical work” or “musical work” often differs according to each tradition, each tradition-dependent example is intellectually robust and meaningful nonetheless.
Normative skepticism may not actually be considered a vice by some philosophers, even if Nussbaum names it as one. It consists of narrating the views of different philosophers and traditions and suspending all judgment about their adequacy. When teaching the history of Western philosophy, some philosophers never really offer any critical view that puts aside a thinker’s claims. But many philosophers hold that some views are less defensible than others, and some are just wrong. They believe this is not only true when considering thinkers within the history of Western philosophy, but also when doing cross-cultural comparative philosophy. While it is true that not all Western philosophy has it right, it is equally true that neither does any other tradition. Some Buddhist, Indian, Confucian, Daoist, and Islamic views should be challenged, and sometimes they will be found deficient either according to agreed-on cross-cultural standards, or because of some form of internal incoherence. Being a comparative philosopher does not entail an uncritical acceptance of the other traditions simply because they are different. It is not expressed in a kind of Romanticism that might think of some philosophical tradition from another culture as always right, or preferable to Western philosophy. Nor does comparative philosophy require a suspension of all critical judgment. Indeed, it is built on the fundamental premise that the conversation across traditions will burn away some dross and refine and confirm some truths. But because philosophical viewpoints sometimes differ so dramatically, it is not always obvious how one might show itself preferable to another on any philosophical grounds. Forming grounds for deciding among views is one of the fundamental tasks of comparative philosophy.
David Wong (1989) has offered a view of the ways in which philosophical traditions may be incommensurable. One kind of incommensurability involves the inability to translate some concepts in one tradition into meaning and reference in some other tradition. A second sort is that some philosophical models differ from others in such fundamental ways as to make it impossible for the advocates to understand each other. Wong thinks that some forms of life may be so far from a person’s experience and philosophical tradition that she is unable to see the merits in another view. The third version of incommensurability is that the traditions differ on what counts as evidence and grounds for decidability, thus making it impossible to make a judgment between them. There is no common or objective decision criterion justifying the preference for one set of claims over another, much less one tradition in its entirety over another. Wong proposes learning about the other tradition as a remedy. The idea is that each philosopher infects the other with a way of seeing. So, the task is to come to an understanding of how the other philosophical tradition is tied to a life that humans have found satisfying and meaningful.
It is often the case that philosophers who realize that critical work must be a part of the comparative project go on to conclude that traditions should be seen as rivals. Alasdair MacIntyre (1991) has explored this very impasse. He thinks that once the comparative project has passed beyond the initial stage of partial incomprehension and partial misrepresentation of the other, and an accurate representation of the other emerges, then the task of showing which rival tradition is rationally superior to the other comes into view. The triumph of one tradition over another may be a result of one standpoint acknowledging, based on its own internal standards, that it is inferior to another viewpoint. And when the resources available for the corrections of these inadequacies are not present in their own tradition, then those persons holding the failed view may transfer their assent to the tradition that has those resources or which has provided an explanation for why the previously held system failed. MacIntyre thinks that this situation can occur even if the two traditions have no common or shared philosophical beliefs or methods; that is, even if they are totally incommensurable. In those situations in which comparative philosophers find themselves in rational debate with those of another tradition, MacIntyre says that each philosopher has a responsibility to see his own standpoint from as problematic a view as possible, admitting the possibility of fallibilism. But he also takes the view that in any comparison of views philosophically, we must be comparing from some standpoint. There is no neutral ground. This is what he means when he says that comparative philosophy eventually becomes the comparison of comparisons.
MacIntyre considers the question whether the comparative philosophical project is a matter of choosing, and even of rational debate. Raising an imaginary objection to his own views, he says, that if one accuses him of presupposing that conception of rational order that is characteristic of the West and not found in Chinese thought, then he simply must say that this is the standpoint from which he stands and he could not have done otherwise. This is a view of the comparative philosophical task, while describing the way in which some comparative philosophers work, is by no means true of them all. Many comparative philosophers (such as those listed in the bibliography below) typically do not think of their work as enabling a decision between rival theories in a rational way. They conceive of their work as a process of conversation in which philosophical progress is made and all the traditions are altered in the resulting narrative.
The difficulty of commensurability is not the only one facing comparative philosophers. A mistake made by many comparative philosophers is that they overlook that philosophical traditions have a present as well as a past. While the classical texts of various traditions are formative and become the basis for much of the distinct evolution of a tradition, a philosopher cannot focus only on them. As those who study any philosophical tradition in depth know very well, all philosophical traditions are evolving. They are not “perennial” in the sense of being monolithic or static. They not only have tensions with other traditions, but they contain internal conflict as well. The point at which a comparative philosopher steps into the stream of another tradition is always important. He must understand not only the reasons for why a particular view is held in another tradition, but also that it is only one view among others that are possible within that particular tradition. For example, if one wants to do comparative morality, focusing on Chinese moral culture, what should he study? The Confucian, the Daoist, the Buddhist, the Marxist critique of all three? And with what aspects of his own tradition will he compare Chinese moral culture? The deontological, the utilitarian, the Aristotelian?
In the end, one may object that actually there is no such thing as comparative philosophy, as a discrete sub-discipline of philosophical work, because all philosophical work is comparative. After all, one thing philosophers habitually do is to compare the work of various thinkers with those of others, or with their own. Philosophers require a thorough survey of the full range of significant views on a question before giving assent. Each view must be tested against others. This is a characteristically comparative project. For example, if one sets Hume’s discussion of personal identity alongside of Locke’s, a comparison is made. It is not self-evident that there is really a difference in comparing Confucius’ views on morality and those of Aristotle, and those of Aquinas and Aristotle on the same subject. Furthermore, if one compares Descartes’ epistemology and truth theory to Hegel’s one is not only making a comparison, but some philosophers would say that the two approaches are so different from each other as to be incommensurable (that is, lacking any common basis for comparison). This means that not only is the task of comparison fundamental to what philosophers do, but also the thought worlds examined may be incommensurable even though they come from the same cultural stream. Descartes and Hegel may be incommensurable on truth in much the same way that Buddhism’s approach to the fundamental problem of humanity and how to handle it is unlike the way Pragmatism thinks of this problem.
One may take the position that Aristotle compared with Confucius on morality is different only in degree from a comparison between Aristotle and Aquinas. However, as Alfred North Whitehead pointed out, a difference in degree may sometimes become a difference in kind. Even if the difference between what philosophers regularly do when comparing thinkers within the Western tradition and what they do when comparing a Western thinker with one from India, for example, is not a matter of kind, still the degree of these differences might be important. But no formal or general rule or criteria can be laid down for distinguishing these types of comparisons. There are ways in which comparing philosophical ideas between traditions and comparing those within the same tradition are similar. Part of the task of comparative philosophers who work cross-culturally is to reveal, in the pursuit of their own work, wherein the differences between these comparative approaches are dramatic and philosophically significant.
Properly speaking, comparative philosophy does not lead toward the creation of a synthesis of philosophical traditions (as in world philosophy). What is being created is not a new theory but a different sort of philosopher. The goal of comparative philosophy is learning a new language, a new way of talking. The comparative philosopher does not so much inhabit both of the standpoints represented by the traditions from which he draws as he comes to inhabit an emerging standpoint different from them all and which is thereby creatively a new way of seeing the human condition.
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Last updated: July 23, 2005 | Originally published: