What is philosophy? What is philosophy for? How should philosophy be done? These are metaphilosophical questions, metaphilosophy being the study of the nature of philosophy. Contemporary metaphilosophies within the Western philosophical tradition can be divided, rather roughly, according to whether they are associated with (1) Analytic philosophy, (2) Pragmatist philosophy, or (3) Continental philosophy.
The pioneers of the Analytic movement held that philosophy should begin with the analysis of propositions. In the hands of two of those pioneers, Russell and Wittgenstein, such analysis gives a central role to logic and aims at disclosing the deep structure of the world. But Russell and Wittgenstein thought philosophy could say little about ethics. The movement known as Logical Positivism shared the aversion to normative ethics. Nonetheless, the positivists meant to be progressive. As part of that, they intended to eliminate metaphysics. The so-called ordinary language philosophers agreed that philosophy centrally involved the analysis of propositions, but, and this recalls a third Analytic pioneer, namely Moore, their analyses remained at the level of natural language as against logic. The later Wittgenstein has an affinity with ordinary language philosophy. For Wittgenstein had come to hold that philosophy should protect us against dangerous illusions by being a kind of therapy for what normally passes for philosophy. Metaphilosophical views held by later Analytic philosophers include the idea that philosophy can be pursued as a descriptive but not a revisionary metaphysics and that philosophy is continuous with science.
The pragmatists, like those Analytic philosophers who work in practical or applied ethics, believed that philosophy should treat ‘real problems’ (although the pragmatists gave ‘real problems’ a wider scope than the ethicists tend to). The neopragmatist Rorty goes so far as to say the philosopher should fashion her philosophy so as to promote her cultural, social, and political goals. So-called post-Analytic philosophy is much influenced by pragmatism. Like the pragmatists, the post-Analyticals tend (1) to favor a broad construal of the philosophical enterprise and (2) to aim at dissolving rather than solving traditional or narrow philosophical problems.
The first Continental position considered herein is Husserl’s phenomenology. Husserl believed that his phenomenological method would enable philosophy to become a rigorous and foundational science. Still, on Husserl’s conception, philosophy is both a personal affair and something that is vital to realizing the humanitarian hopes of the Enlightenment. Husserl’s existential successors modified his method in various ways and stressed, and refashioned, the ideal of authenticity presented by his writings. Another major Continental tradition, namely Critical Theory, makes of philosophy a contributor to emancipatory social theory; and the version of Critical Theory pursued by Jürgen Habermas includes a call for 'postmetaphysical thinking'. The later thought of Heidegger advocates a postmetaphysical thinking too, albeit a very different one; and Heidegger associates metaphysics with the ills of modernity. Heidegger strongly influenced Derrida’s metaphilosophy. Derrida’s deconstructive approach to philosophy (1) aims at clarifying, and loosening the grip of, the assumptions of previous, metaphysical philosophy, and (2) means to have an ethical and political import.
The main topic of the article is the Western metaphilosophy of the last hundred years or so. But that topic is broached via a sketch of some earlier Western metaphilosophies. (In the case of the sketch, ‘Western’ means European. In the remainder of the article, ‘Western’ means European and North American. On Eastern metaphilosophy, see the entries filed under such heads as ‘Chinese philosophy’ and ‘Indian philosophy’.) Once that sketch is in hand, the article defines the notion of metaphilosophy and distinguishes between explicit and implicit metaphilosophy. Then there is a consideration of how metaphilosophies might be categorized and an outline of the course of the remainder of the article.
Socrates believed that the unexamined life – the unphilosophical life – was not worth living (Plato, Apology, 38a). Indeed, Socrates saw his role as helping to rouse people from unreflective lives. He did this by showing them, through his famous ‘Socratic method’, that in fact they knew little about, for example, justice, beauty, love or piety. Socrates’ use of that method contributed to his being condemned to death by the Athenian state. But Socrates’ politics contributed too; and here one can note that, according to the Republic (473c-d), humanity will prosper only when philosophers are kings or kings’ philosophers. It is notable too that, in Plato’s Phaedo, Socrates presents death as liberation of the soul from the tomb of the body.
According to Aristotle, philosophy begins in wonder, seeks the most fundamental causes or principles of things, and is the least necessary but thereby the most divine of sciences (Metaphysics, book alpha, sections 1–3). Despite the point about necessity, Aristotle taught ethics, a subject he conceived as ‘a kind of political science’ (Nicomachean Ethics, book 1) and which had the aim of making men good. Later philosophers continued and even intensified the stress on philosophical practicality. According to the Hellenistic philosophers – the Cynics, Sceptics, Epicureans and Stoics - philosophy revealed (1) what was valuable and what was not, and (2) how one could achieve the former and protect oneself against longing for the latter. The Roman Cicero held that to study philosophy is to prepare oneself for death. The later and neoplatonic thinker Plotinus asked, ‘What, then, is Philosophy?’ and answered, ‘Philosophy is the supremely precious’ (Enneads, I.3.v): a means to blissful contact with a mystical principle he called ‘the One’.
The idea that philosophy is the handmaiden of theology, earlier propounded by the Hellenistic thinker Philo of Alexandria, is most associated with the medieval age and particularly with Aquinas. Aquinas resumed the project of synthesizing Christianity with Greek philosophy - a project that had been pursued already by various thinkers including Augustine, Anselm, and Boethius. (Boethius was a politician inspired by philosophy – but the politics ended badly for him. In those respects he resembles the earlier Seneca. And, like Seneca, Boethius wrote of the consolations of philosophy.)
‘[T]he word “philosophy” means the study [or love – philo] of wisdom, and by “wisdom” is meant not only prudence in our everyday affairs but also a perfect knowledge of all things that mankind is capable of knowing, both for the conduct of life and for the preservation of health and the discovery of all manner of skills.’ Thus Descartes (1988: p. 179). Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding (bk. 4. ch. 19, p. 697) connects philosophy with the love of truth and identifies the following as an ‘unerring mark’ of that love: ‘The not entertaining any Proposition with greater assurance than the Proofs it is built upon will warrant.’ Hume’s ‘Of Suicide’ opens thus: ‘One considerable advantage that arises from Philosophy, consists in the sovereign antidote which it affords to superstition and false religion’ (Hume 1980: 97). Kant held that ‘What can I know?’, ‘What ought I to do?’, and, ‘What may I hope?’ were the ultimate questions of human reason (Critique of Pure Reason, A805 / B33) and asserted that philosophy’s ‘peculiar dignity’ lies in ‘principles of morality, legislation, and religion’ that it can provide (A318 / B375). According to Hegel, the point of philosophy – or of ‘the dialectic’ – is to enable people to recognize the embodiment of their ideals in their social and political lives and thereby to be at home in the world. Marx’s famous eleventh ‘Thesis on Feuerbach’ declared that, while philosophers had interpreted the world, the point was to change it.
As the foregoing sketch begins to suggest, three very general metaphilosophical questions are (1) What is philosophy? (2) What is, or what should be, the point of philosophy? (3) How should one do philosophy? Those questions resolve into a host of more specific metaphilosophical conundra, some of which are as follows. Is philosophy a process or a product? What kind of knowledge can philosophy attain? How should one understand philosophical disagreement? Is philosophy historical in some special or deep way? Should philosophy make us better people? Happier people? Is philosophy political? What method(s) and types of evidence suit philosophy? How should philosophy be written (presuming it should be written at all)? Is philosophy, in some sense, over – or should it be?
But how might one define metaphilosophy? One definition owes to Morris Lazerowitz. (Lazerowitz claims to have invented the English word ‘metaphilosophy’ in 1940. But some foreign-language equivalents of the term ‘metaphilosophy’ antedate 1940. Note further that, in various languages including English, sometimes the term takes a hyphen before the ‘meta’.) Lazerowitz proposed (1970) that metaphilosophy is ‘the investigation of the nature of philosophy.’ If we take ‘nature’ to include both the point of philosophy and how one does (or should do) philosophy, then that definition fits with the most general metaphilosophical questions just identified above. Still: there are other definitions of metaphilosophy; and while Lazerowitz’s definition will prove best for our purposes, one needs – in order to appreciate that fact, and in order to give the definition a suitable (further) gloss – to survey the alternatives.
One alternative definition construes metaphilosophy as the philosophy of philosophy. Sometimes that definition intends this idea: metaphilosophy applies the method(s) of philosophy to philosophy itself. That idea itself comes in two versions. One is a ‘first-order’ construal. The thought here is this. Metaphilosophy, as the application of philosophy to philosophy itself, is simply one more instance of philosophy (Wittgenstein 2001: section 121; Williamson 2007: ix). The other version – the ‘second-order’ version of the idea that metaphilosophy applies philosophy to itself – is as follows. Metaphilosophy stands to philosophy as philosophy stands to its subject matter or to other disciplines (Rescher 2006), such that, as Williamson puts it (loc. cit) metaphilosophy ‘look[s] down upon philosophy from above, or beyond.’ (Williamson himself, who takes the first-order view, prefers the term ‘the philosophy of philosophy’ to ‘metaphilosophy’. For he thinks that ‘metaphilosophy’ has this connotation of looking down.) A different definition of metaphilosophy exploits the fact that ‘meta’ can mean not only about but also after. On this definition, metaphilosophy is post-philosophy. Sometimes Lazerowitz himself used ‘metaphilosophy’ in that way. What he had in mind here, more particularly, is the ‘special kind of investigation which Wittgenstein had described as one of the “heirs” of philosophy’ (Lazerowitz 1970). Some French philosophers have used the term similarly, though with reference to Heidegger and/or Marx rather than to Wittgenstein (Elden 2004: 83).
What then commends Lazerowitz’s (original) definition – the definition whereby metaphilosophy is investigation of the nature (and point) of philosophy? Two things. (1) The two ‘philosophy–of–philosophy’ construals are competing specifications of that definition. Indeed, those construals have little content until after one has a considerable idea of what philosophy is. (2) The equation of metaphilosophy and post-philosophy is narrow and tendentious; but Lazerowitz’s definition accommodates post-philosophy as a position within a more widely construed metaphilosophy. Still: Lazerowitz’s definition does require qualification, since there is a sense in which it is too broad. For ‘investigation of the nature of philosophy’ suggests that any inquiry into philosophy will count as metaphilosophical, whereas an inquiry tends to be deemed metaphilosophical only when it pertains to the essence, or very nature, of philosophy. (Such indeed is a third possible reading of the philosophy-of-philosophy construal.) Now, just what does so pertain is moot; and there is a risk of being too unaccommodating. We might want to deny the title ‘metaphilosophy’ to, say, various sociological studies of philosophy, and even, perhaps, to philosophical pedagogy (that is, to the subject of how philosophy is taught). On the other hand, we are inclined to count as metaphilosophical claims about, for instance, philosophy corrupting its students or about professionalization corrupting philosophy (on these claims one may see Stewart 1995 and Anscombe 1957).
What follows will give a moderately narrow interpretation to the term ‘nature’ within the phrase ‘the nature of philosophy’.
Explicit metaphilosophy is metaphilosophy pursued as a subfield of, or attendant field to, philosophy. Metaphilosophy so conceived has waxed and waned. In the early twenty-first century, it has waxed in Europe and in the Anglophone (English-speaking) world. Probable causes of the increasing interest include Analytic philosophy having become more aware of itself as a tradition, the rise of philosophizing of a more empirical sort, and a softening of the divide between ‘Analytic’ and ‘Continental’ philosophy. (This article will revisit all of those topics in one way or another.) However, even when waxing, metaphilosophy generates much less activity than philosophy. Certainly the philosophical scene contains few book-length pieces of metaphilosophy. Books such as Williamson’s The Philosophy of Philosophy, Rescher’s Essay on Metaphilosophy, and What is Philosophy? by Deleuze and Guattari – these are not the rule but the exception.
There is more to metaphilosophy than explicit metaphilosophy. For there is also implicit metaphilosophy. To appreciate that point, consider, first, that philosophical positions can have metaphilosophical aspects. Many philosophical views – views about, say, knowledge, or language, or authenticity – can have implications for the task or nature of philosophy. Indeed, all philosophizing is somewhat metaphilosophical, at least in this sense: any philosophical view or orientation commits its holder to a metaphilosophy that accommodates it. Thus if one advances an ontology one must have a metaphilosophy that countenances ontology. Similarly, to adopt a method or style is to deem that approach at least passable. Moreover, a conception of the nature and point of philosophy, albeit perhaps an inchoate one, motivates and shapes much philosophy. But – and this is what allows there to be implicit metaphilosophy – sometimes none of this is emphasized, or even appreciated at all, by those who philosophize. Much of the metaphilosophy treated here is implicit, at least in the attenuated sense that its authors give philosophy much more attention than philosophy.
One way of classifying metaphilosophy would be by the aim that a given metaphilosophy attributes to philosophy. Alternatively, one could consider that which is taken as the model for philosophy or for philosophical form. Science? Art? Therapy? Something else? A further alternative is to distinguish metaphilosophies according to whether or not they conceive philosophy as somehow essentially linguistic. Another criterion would be the rejection or adoption or conception of metaphysics (metaphysics being something like the study of' the fundamental nature of reality). And many further classifications are possible.
This article will employ the Analytic–Continental distinction as its most general classificatory schema. Or rather it uses these categories: (1) Analytic philosophy; (2) Continental philosophy; (3) pragmatism, neopragmatism, and post-Analytic philosophy, these being only some of the most important of metaphilosophies of the last century or so. Those metaphilosophies are distinguished from one from another via the philosophies or philosophical movements (movements narrower than those of the three top-level headings) to which they have been conjoined. That approach, and indeed the article's most general schema, means that this account is organized by chronology as much as by theme. One virtue of the approach is that it provides a degree of historical perspective. Another is that the approach helps to disclose some rather implicit metaphilosophy associated with well-known philosophies. But the article will be thematic to a degree because it will bring out some points of identity and difference between various metaphilosophies and will consider criticisms of the metaphilosophies treated. However, the article will not much attempt to determine, on metaphilosophical or other criteria, the respective natures of Analytic philosophy, pragmatism, or Continental philosophy. The article employs those categories solely for organizational purposes. But note the following points.
Bertrand Russell, his pupil Ludwig Wittgenstein, and their colleague G. E. Moore – the pioneers of Analytic philosophy – shared the view that ‘all sound philosophy should begin with an analysis of propositions’ (Russell 1992: 9; first published in 1900). In Russell and Wittgenstein such analysis was centrally a matter of logic. (Note, however, that the expression ‘Analytic philosophy’ seems to have emerged only in the 1930s.)
Russellian analysis has two stages (Beaney 2007: 2–3 and 2009: section 3; Urmson 1956). First, propositions of ordinary or scientific language are transformed into what Russell regarded as their true form. This ‘logical’ or ‘transformative’ analysis draws heavily upon the new logic of Frege and finds its exemplar in Russell’s ‘theory of descriptions’ (Analytic Philosophy, section 2.a). The next step is to correlate elements within the transformed propositions with elements in the world. Commentators have called this second stage or form of analysis – which Russell counted as a matter of ‘philosophical logic’ – ‘reductive’, ‘decompositional’, and ‘metaphysical’. It is decompositional and reductive inasmuch as, like chemical analysis, it seeks to revolve its objects into their simplest elements, such an element being simple in that it itself lacks parts or constituents. The analysis is metaphysical in that it yields a metaphysics. According to the metaphysics that Russell actually derived from his analysis – the metaphysics which he called ‘logical atomism’ – the world comprises indivisible ‘atoms’ that combine, in structures limned by logic, to form the entities of science and everyday life. Russell’s empiricism inclined him to conceive the atoms as mind-independent sense-data. (See further Russell’s Metaphysics, section 4.)
Logic in the dual form of analysis just sketched was the essence of philosophy, according to Russell (2009: ch. 2). Nonetheless, Russell wrote on practical matters, advocating, and campaigning for, liberal and socialist ideas. But he tended to regard such activities as unphilosophical, believing that ethical statements were non-cognitive and hence little amenable to philosophical analysis (see Non-Cognitivism in Ethics). But he did come to hold a form of utilitarianism that allowed ethical statements a kind of truth-aptness. And he did endorse a qualified version of this venerable idea: the contemplation of profound things enlarges the self and fosters happiness. Russell held further that practicing an ethics was little use given contemporary politics, a view informed by worries about the effects of conformity and technocracy. (On all this, see Schultz 1992.)
Wittgenstein agreed with Frege and Russell that ‘the apparent logical form of a proposition need not be its real one’ (Wittgenstein 1961: section 4.0031). And he agreed with Russell that language and the world share a common, ultimately atomistic, form. But Wittgenstein’s Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus developed these ideas into a somewhat Kantian and actually rather Schopenhauerian position. (That book, first published in 1921, is the main and arguably only work of the so-called ‘early Wittgenstein’. section 2.c treats Wittgenstein’s later views.) The Tractatus taught the following. Only when propositions depict possible states of affairs do they have sense. Propositions of science and of everyday language pass that test. Propositions of logic do not quite do so. They have the form necessary for depiction; but they depict nothing because they boil down to either tautologies or contradictions. Hence they are ‘senseless’ (in Wittgenstein’s original German: sinnlos). As to metaphysical statements – statements about, inter alia, the meaning of life and God, and statements of ethics and aesthetics – they are ‘nonsense’ (Unsinn). They try to depict something. But what they try to depict is no possible state of affairs within the world. Wittgenstein concludes that philosophy is ‘a critique of language’ that detects and expunges metaphysical talk (Wittgenstein 1961: section 4.0031). ‘[W]henever someone [...] want[s] to say something metaphysical’, one should ‘demonstrate to him that he had failed to give a meaning to certain signs in his propositions’ (section 6.53). But there is a complication. Wittgenstein (section 6.54–7): ‘anyone who understands me eventually recognizes [my own propositions] as nonsensical, when he has used them–as steps–to climb up beyond them [...] He must transcend these propositions, and then he will see the world aright. What we cannot speak about we must pass over in silence’. Still, Wittgenstein applies the honorifics ‘mystical’ and ‘higher’ (section 6.42–6.522) to his statements about the limits of language and to various other metaphysical statements, including ethical ones. In the case of these (‘mystical’/‘higher’) nonsensical propositions, the point of remaining silent about them is not to damn them but rather to leave their truth unprofaned.
Like Russell and Wittgenstein, Moore advocated a form of decompositional analysis. He held that ‘a thing becomes intelligible first when it is analyzed into its constituent concepts’ (Moore 1899: 182; see further Beaney 2009: section 4). But Moore uses normal language rather than logic to specify those constituents; and, in his hands, analysis often supported commonplace, pre-philosophical beliefs. Nonetheless, and despite confessing that other philosophers rather than the world prompted his philosophizing (Schilpp 1942: 14), Moore held that philosophy should give ‘a general description of the whole Universe’ (1953: 1). Accordingly, Moore tackled ethics and aesthetics as well as epistemology and metaphysics. His Principia Ethica used the not-especially-commonsensical idea that goodness was a simple, indefinable quality in order to defend the meaningfulness of ethical statements and the objectivity of moral value. Additionally, Moore advanced a normative ethic, the wider social or political implications of which are debated (Hutchinson 2001).
Russell’s tendency to exclude ethics from philosophy, and Wittgenstein’s protective version of the exclusion, are contentious and presuppose their respective versions of atomism. In turn, that atomism relies heavily upon the idea, as metaphilosophical as it is philosophical, of an ideal language (or at least of an ideal analysis of natural language). Later sections criticize that idea. Such criticism finds little target in Moore. Yet Moore is a target for those who hold that philosophy should be little concerned with words or even, perhaps, with concepts (see section 2.c and the ‘revivals’ treated in section 2.d).
We witness the spirit of the scientific world-conception penetrating in growing measure the forms of personal and public life, in education, upbringing, architecture, and the shaping of economic and social life according to rational principles. The scientific world-conception serves life, and life receives it. The task of philosophical work lies in [...] clarification of problems and assertions, not in the propounding of special “philosophical” pronouncements. The method of this clarification is that of logical analysis.
The foregoing passages owe to a manifesto issued by the Vienna Circle (Neurath, Carnap, and Hahn 1973: 317f. and 328). Leading members of that Circle included Moritz Schlick (a physicist turned philosopher), Rudolf Carnap (primarily a logician), and Otto Neurath (economist, sociologist, and philosopher). These thinkers were inspired by the original positivist, Auguste Comte. Other influences included the empiricisms of Hume, Russell and Ernst Mach, and also the Russell–Wittgenstein idea of an ideal logical language. (Wittgenstein's Tractatus, in particular, was a massive influence.) The Circle, in turn, gave rise to an international movement that went under several names: logical positivism, logical empiricism, neopositivism, and simply positivism.
The clarification or logical analysis advocated by positivism is two-sided. Its destructive task was the use of the so-called verifiability principle to eliminate metaphysics. According to that principle, a statement is meaningful only when either true by definition or verifiable through experience. (So there is no synthetic apriori. See Kant, Metaphysics, section 2, and A Priori and A Posteriori.) The positivists placed mathematics and logic within the true-by-definition (or analytic apriori) category, and science and most normal talk in the category of verifiable-through-experience (or synthetic aposteriori). All else was deemed meaningless. That fate befell metaphysical statements and finds its most famous illustration in Carnap’s attack (1931) on Heidegger’s ‘What is Metaphysics?’ It was the fate, too, of ethical and aesthetic statements. Hence the non-cognitivist meta-ethics that some positivists developed.
The constructive side of positivistic analysis involved epistemology and philosophy of science. The positivists wanted to know exactly how experience justified empirical knowledge. Sometimes – the positivists took various positions on the issue – the idea was to reduce all scientific statements to those of physics. (See Reductionism.) That particular effort went under the heading of ‘unified science’. So too did an idea that sought to make good on the claim that positivism ‘served life’. The idea I have in mind was this: the sciences should collaborate in order to help solve social problems. That project was championed by the so-called Left Vienna Circle and, within that, especially by Neurath (who served in a socialist Munich government and, later, was a central figure in Austrian housing movements). The positivists had close relations with the Bauhaus movement, which was itself understood by its members as socially progressive (Galison 1990).
Positivism had its problems and its detractors. The believer in ‘special philosophical pronouncements’ will think that positivism decapitates philosophy (compare section 4.a below, on Husserl). Moreover, positivism itself seemingly involved at least one ‘special’ – read: metaphysical – pronouncement, namely, the verifiability principle. Further, there is reason to distrust the very idea of providing strict criteria for nonsense (see Glendinning 2001). Further yet, the idea of an ideal logical language was attacked as unachievable, incoherent, and/or – when used as a means to certify philosophical truth – circular (Copi 1949). There were the following doubts, too, about whether positivism really ‘served life’. (1) Might positivism’s narrow notion of fact prevent it from comprehending the real nature of society? (Critical Theory leveled that objection. See O’Neill and Uebel 2004.) (2) Might positivism involve a disastrous reduction of politics to the discovery of technical solutions to depoliticized ends? (This objection owes again to Critical Theory, but also to others. See Galison 1990 and O’Neill 2003.)
Positivism retained some coherence as a movement or doctrine until the late 1960s, even though the Nazis – with whom the positivists clashed – forced the Circle into exile. In fact, that exile helped to spread the positivist creed. But, not long after the Second World War, the ascendancy that positivism had acquired in Anglophone philosophy began to diminish. It did so partly because of the developments considered by the next section.
Some accounts group ordinary language philosophy and the philosophy of the later Wittgenstein (and of Wittgenstein’s disciples) together – under the title ‘linguistic philosophy’. That grouping can mislead. All previous Analytic philosophy was centrally concerned with language. In that sense, all previous Analytic philosophy had taken the so-called ‘linguistic turn’ (see Rorty 1992). Nevertheless, ordinary language philosophy and the later Wittgenstein do mark a change. They twist the linguistic turn away from logical or constructed languages and towards ordinary (that is, vernacular) language, or at least towards natural (non-artificial) language. Thereby the new bodies of thought represent a movement away from Russell, the early Wittgenstein, and the positivists (and back, to an extent, towards Moore). In short – and as many accounts of the history of Analytic philosophy put it – we have here a shift from ideal language philosophy to ordinary language philosophy.
Ordinary language philosophy began with and centrally comprised a loose grouping of philosophers among whom the Oxford dons Gilbert Ryle and J. L. Austin loomed largest. The following view united these philosophers. Patient analysis of the meaning of words can tap the rich distinctions of natural languages and minimize the unclarities, equivocations and conflations to which philosophers are prone. So construed, philosophy is unlike natural science and even, insofar as it avoided systematization, unlike linguistics. The majority of ordinary language philosophers did hold, with Austin, that such analysis was not the ‘the last word’ in philosophy. Specialist knowledge and techniques can in principle everywhere augment and improve it. But natural or ordinary language ‘is the first word’ (Austin 1979: 185; see also Analytic Philosophy, section 4a).
The later Wittgenstein did hold, or at least came close to holding, that ordinary language has the last word in philosophy. This later Wittgenstein retained his earlier view that philosophy was a critique of language – of language that tried to be metaphysical or philosophical. But he abandoned the idea (itself problematically metaphysical) that there was one true form to language. He came to think, instead, that all philosophical problems owe to ‘misinterpretation of our forms of language’ (Wittgenstein 2001: section 111). They owe to misunderstanding of the ways language actually works. A principal cause of such misunderstanding, Wittgenstein thought, is misassimilation of expressions one to another. Such misassimilation can be motivated, in turn, by a ‘craving for generality’ (Wittgenstein 1975: 17ff.) that is inspired by science. The later Wittgenstein’s own philosophizing means to be a kind of therapy for philosophers, a therapy which will liberate them from their problems by showing how, in their very formulations of those problems, their words have ceased to make sense. Wittgenstein tries to show how the words that give philosophers trouble – words such as ‘know’, ‘mind’, and ‘sensation’ – become problematical only when, in philosophers’ hands, they depart from the uses and the contexts that give them meaning. Thus a sense in which philosophy ‘leaves everything as it is’ (2001: section 124). ‘[W]e must do away with all explanation, and description alone must take its place’ (section 124). Still, Wittgenstein himself once asked, ‘[W]hat is the use of studying philosophy if all that it does for you is to enable you to talk with some plausibility about some abstruse questions of logic, etc. [...]’? (cited in Malcolm 1984: 35 and 93). And in one sense Wittgenstein did not want to leave everything as it was. To wit: he wanted to end the worship of science. For the view that science could express all genuine truths was, he held, barbarizing us by impoverishing our understanding of the world and of ourselves.
Much metaphilosophical flack has been aimed at the later Wittgenstein and ordinary language philosophy. They have been accused of: abolishing practical philosophy; rendering philosophy uncritical; trivializing philosophy by making it a mere matter of words; enshrining the ignorance of common speech; and, in Wittgenstein’s case – and in his own words (taken out of context) – of ‘destroy[ing] everything interesting’ (2001: section 118; on these criticisms see Russell 1995: ch. 18, Marcuse 1991: ch. 7 and Gellner 2005). Nonetheless, it is at least arguable that these movements of thought permanently changed Analytic philosophy by making it more sensitive to linguistic nuance and to the oddities of philosophical language. Moreover, some contemporary philosophers have defended more or less Wittgensteinian conceptions of philosophy. One such philosopher is Peter Strawson (on whom see section 2.d.iii). Another is Stanley Cavell. Note also that some writers have attempted to develop the more practical side of Wittgenstein’s thought (Pitkin 1993, Cavell 1979).
Between the 1950s and the 1970s, there were three significant, and persisting, metaphilosophical developments within the Analytic tradition.
During positivism’s ascendancy, and for some time thereafter, substantive normative issues – questions about how one should live, what sort of government is best or legitimate, and so on – were widely deemed quasi-philosophical. Positivism’s non-cognitivism was a major cause. So was the distrust, in the later Wittgenstein and in ordinary language philosophy, of philosophical theorizing. This neglect of the normative had its exceptions. But the real change occurred with the appearance, in 1971, of A Theory of Justice by John Rawls.
Many took Rawls' book to show, through its ‘systematicity and clarity’, that normative theory was possible ‘without loss of rigor’ (Weithman 2003: 6). Rawls' procedure for justifying normative principles is of particular metaphilosophical note. That procedure, called ‘reflective equilibrium’, has three steps. (The quotations that follow are from Schroeter 2004.)
The conception of reflective equilibrium was perhaps less philosophically orthodox than most readers of Theory of Justice believed. For Rawls came to argue that his conception of justice was, or should be construed as, ‘political not metaphysical’ (Rawls 1999b: 47–72). A political conception of justice ‘stays on the surface, philosophically speaking’ (Rawls 1999b: 395). It appeals only to that which ‘given our history and the traditions embedded in our public life [...] is the most reasonable doctrine for us’ (p. 307). A metaphysical conception of justice appeals to something beyond such contingencies. However: despite advocating the political conception, Rawls appeals to an ‘overlapping consensus’ (his term) of metaphysical doctrines. The idea here, or hope, is this (Rawls, section 3; Freeman 2007: 324–415). Citizens in modern democracies hold various and not fully inter-compatible political and social ideas. But those citizens will be able to unite in supporting a liberal conception of justice.
Around the same time as Theory of Justice appeared, a parallel revival in normative philosophy begun. This was the rise of practical ethics. Here is how one prominent practical ethicist presents ‘the most plausible explanation’ for that development. ‘[L]aw, ethics, and many of the professions—including medicine, business, engineering, and scientific research—were profoundly and permanently affected by issues and concerns in the wider society regarding individual liberties, social equality, and various forms of abuse and injustice that date from the late 1950s’ (Beauchamp 2002: 133f.). Now the new ethicists, who insisted that philosophy should treat ‘real problems’ (Beauchamp 2002: 134), did something largely foreign to previous Analytic philosophy (and to that extent did not, in fact, constitute a revival). They applied moral theory to such concrete and pressing matters as racism, sexual equality, abortion, governance and war. (On those problems, see Ethics, section 3).
According to some practical ethicists, moral principles are not only applied to, but also drawn from, cases. The issue here – the relation between theory and its application – broadened out into a more thoroughly metaphilosophical debate. For, soon after Analytic philosophers had returned to normative ethics, some of them rejected a prevalent conception of normative ethical theory, and others entirely rejected such theory. The first camp rejects moral theory qua ‘decision procedure for moral reasoning’ (Williams 1981: ix-x) but does not foreclose other types of normative theory such as virtue ethics. The second and more radical camp holds that the moral world is too complex for any (prescriptive) codification that warrants the name ‘theory’. (On these positions, see Lance and Little 2006, Clarke 1987, Chappell 2009.)
For a long time, most analytic philosophers held that the history of philosophy had little to do with doing philosophy. For what – they asked - was the history of philosophy save, largely, a series of mistakes? We might learn from those mistakes, and the history might contain some occasional insights. But (the line of thought continues) we should be wary of resurrecting the mistakes and beware the archive fever that leads to the idea that there is no such thing as philosophical progress. But in the 1970s a more positive attitude to the history of philosophy began to emerge, together with an attempt to reinstate or re-legitimate serious historical scholarship within philosophy (compare Analytic Philosophy section 5.c).
The newly positive attitude towards the history of philosophy was premised on the view that the study of past philosophies was of significant philosophical value. Reasons adduced for that view include the following (Sorell and Rogers 2005). History of philosophy can disclose our assumptions. It can show the strengths of positions that we find uncongenial. It can suggest rolesthat philosophy might take today by revealing ways in which philosophy has been embedded in a wider intellectual and sociocultural frameworks. A more radical view, espoused by Charles Taylor (1984: 17) is that, ‘Philosophy and the history of philosophy are one’; ‘we cannot do the first without also doing the second.’
Many Analytical philosophers continue to regard the study of philosophy’s history as very much secondary to philosophy itself. By contrast, many so-called Continental philosophers take the foregoing ideas, including the more radical view – which is associated with Hegel – as axiomatic. (See much of section 4, below.)
Positivism, the later Wittgenstein, and Ordinary Language Philosophy suppressed Analytic metaphysics. Yet it recovered, thanks especially to three figures, beginning with Peter Strawson.
Strawson had his origins in the ordinary language tradition and he declares a large debt or affinity to Wittgenstein (Strawson 2003: 12). But he is indebted, also, to Kant; and, with Strawson, ordinary language philosophy became more systematic and more ambitious. However, Strawson retained an element of what one might call, in Rae Langton’s phrase, Kantian humility. In order to understand these characterizations, one needs to appreciate that which Strawson advocated under the heading of ‘descriptive metaphysics’. In turn, descriptive metaphysics is best approached via that which Strawson called ‘connective analysis’.
Connective analysis seeks to elucidate concepts by discerning their interconnections, which is to say, the ways in which concepts variously imply, presuppose, and exclude one another. Strawson contrasts this ‘connective model’ with ‘the reductive or atomistic model’ that aims ‘to dismantle or reduce the concepts we examine to other and simpler concepts’ (all Strawson 1991: 21). The latter model is that of Russell, the Tractatus, and, indeed, Moore. Another way in which Strawson departs from Russell and the Tractatus, but not from Moore, lies in this: a principal method of connective analysis is ‘close examination of the actual use of words’ (Strawson 1959: 9). But when Strawson turns to ‘descriptive metaphysics’, such examination is not enough.
Descriptive metaphysics is, or proceeds via, a very general form of connective analysis. The goal here is ‘to lay bare the most general features of our conceptual structure’ (Strawson 1959: 9). Those most general features – our most general concepts – have a special importance. For those concepts, or at least those of them in which Strawson is most interested, are (he thinks) basic or fundamental in the following sense. They are (1) irreducible, (2) unchangeable in that they comprise ‘a massive central core of human thinking which has no history’ (1959: 10) and (3) necessary to ‘any conception of experience which we can make intelligible to ourselves’ (Strawson 1991: 26). And the structure that these concepts comprise ‘does not readily display itself on the surface of language, but lies submerged’ (1956: 9f.).
Descriptive metaphysics is considerably Kantian (see Kant, metaphysics). Strawson is Kantian, too, in rejecting what he calls ‘revisionary metaphysics’. Here we have the element of Kantian ‘humility’ within Strawson’s enterprise. Descriptive metaphysics ‘is content to describe the actual structure of our thought about the world’, whereas revisionary metaphysics aims ‘to produce a better structure’ (Strawson 1959: 9; my stress). Strawson urges several points against revisionary metaphysics.
Here are some worries about Strawson’s metaphilosophy. ‘[T]he conceptual system with which “we” are operating may be much more changing, relative, and culturally limited than Strawson assumes it to be’ (Burtt 1963: 35). Next: Strawson imparts very little about the method(s) of descriptive metaphysics (although one might try to discern techniques – in which imagination seems to play a central role – from his actual analyses). More serious is that Strawson imparts little by way of answer to the following questions. ‘What is a concept? How are concepts individuated? What is a conceptual scheme? How are conceptual schemes individuated? What is the relation between a language and a conceptual scheme?’ (Haack 1979: 366f.). Further: why believe that the analytic philosopher has no business providing ‘new and revealing vision[s]’ (Strawson 1992: 2)? At any rate, Strawson helped those philosophers who rejected reductive (especially Russellian and positivistic) versions of analysis but who wanted to continue to call themselves ‘analytic’. For he gave them a reasonably narrow conception of analysis to which they could adhere (Beaney 2009: section 8; compare Glock 2008: 159). Finally note that, despite his criticisms of Strawson, the contemporary philosopher Peter Hacker defends a metaphilosophy rather similar to descriptive metaphysics (Hacker 2003 and 2007).
William Van Orman Quine was a second prime mover in the metaphysical revival. Quine’s metaphysics, which is revisionary in Strawson’s terms, emerged from Quine’s attack upon ‘two dogmas of modern empiricism’. Those ostensible dogmas are: (1) ‘belief in some fundamental cleavage between truths that are analytic, or grounded in meanings independently of matters of fact, and truths that are synthetic, or grounded in fact’; (2) ‘reductionism: the belief that each meaningful statement is equivalent to some logical construction upon terms which refer to immediate experience’ (Quine 1980: 20). Against 1, Quine argues that every belief has some connection to experience. Against 2, he argues that the connection is never direct. For when experience clashes with some belief, which belief(s) must be changed is underdetermined. Beliefs ‘face the tribunal of sense experience not individually but as a corporate body’ (p. 41; see Evidence section 3.c.i). Quine expresses this holistic and radically empiricist conception by speaking of ‘the web of belief’. Some beliefs – those near the ‘edge of the web’ – are more exposed to experience than others; but the interlinking of beliefs is such that no belief is immune to experience.
Quine saves metaphysics from positivism. More judiciously put: Quine’s conception, if correct, saves metaphysics from the verifiability criterion (q.v. section 2.b). For the notion of the web of belief implies that ontological beliefs – beliefs about ‘the most general traits of reality’ (Quine 1960: 161) – are answerable to experience. And, if that is so, then ontological beliefs differ from other beliefs only in their generality. Quine infers that, ‘Ontological questions [...] are on a par with questions of natural science’ (1980: 45). In fact, since Quine thinks that natural science, and in particular physics, is the best way of fitting our beliefs to reality, he infers that ontology should be determined by the best available comprehensive scientific theory. In that sense, metaphysics is ‘the metaphysics of science’ (Glock 2003a: 30).
Is the metaphysics of science actually only science? Quine asserts that ‘it is only within science itself, and not in some prior philosophy, that reality is to be identified and described’ (1981: 21). Yet he does leave a job for the philosopher. The philosopher is to translate the best available scientific theory into that which Quine called ‘canonical notation’, namely, ‘the language of modern logic as developed by Frege, Peirce, Russell and others’ (Orenstein 2002: 16). Moreover, the philosopher is to make the translation in such a way as to minimize the theory’s ontological commitments. Only after such a translation, which Quine calls ‘explication’ can one say, at a philosophical level: ‘that is What There Is’. (However, Quine cannot fully capitalize those letters, as it were. For he thinks that there is a pragmatic element to ontology. See section 3.a below.) This role for philosophy is a reduced one. For one thing, it deprives philosophy of something traditionally considered one of its greatest aspirations: necessary truth. On Quine’s conception, no truth can be absolutely necessary. (That holds even for the truths of Quine’s beloved logic, since they, too, fall within the web of belief.) By contrast, even Strawson and the positivists – the latter in the form of ‘analytic truth’ – had countenanced versions of necessary truth.
Saul Kripke - the third important reviver of metaphysics - allows the philosopher a role that is perhaps slightly more distinct than Quine does. Kripke does that precisely by propounding a new notion of necessity. (That said, some identify Ruth Barcan Marcus as the discoverer of the necessity at issue.) According to Kripke (1980), a truth T about X is necessary just when T holds in all possible worlds that contain X. To explain: science shows us that, for example, water is composed of H20; the philosophical question is whether that truth holds of all possible worlds (all possible worlds in which water exists) and is thereby necessary. Any such science-derived necessities are aposteriori just because, and in the sense that, they are (partially) derived from science.
Aposteriori necessity is a controversial idea. Kripke realizes this. But he asks why it is controversial. The notions of the apriori and aposteriori are epistemological (they are about whether or not one needs to investigate the world in order to know something), whereas – Kripke points out – his notion of necessity is ontological (that is, about whether things could be otherwise). As to how one determines whether a truth obtains in all possible worlds, Kripke’s main appeal is to the intuitions of philosophers. The next subsection somewhat scrutinizes that appeal, together with some of the other ideas of this subsection.
Kripke and especially Quine helped to create, particularly in the United States, a new orthodoxy within Analytic philosophy. That orthodoxy is naturalism or - the term used by its detractors - scientism. But naturalism (/scientism) is no one thing (Glock 2003a: 46; compare Papineau 2009). Ontological naturalism holds that the entities treated by natural science exhaust reality. Metaphilosophical naturalism – which is the focus in what follows – asserts a strong continuity between philosophy and science. A common construal of that continuity runs thus. Philosophical problems are in one way or another ‘tractable through the methods of the empirical sciences’ (Naturalism, Introduction). Now, within metaphilosophical naturalism, one can distinguish empirical philosophers from experimental philosophers (Prinz 2008). Empirical philosophers enlist science to answer, or to help answer, philosophical problems. Experimental philosophers (or ‘experimentalists’) themselves do science, or do so in collaboration with scientists. Let us start with empirical philosophy.
Quine is an empirical philosopher in his approach to metaphysics and even more so in his approach to epistemology. Quine presents and urges his epistemology thus: ‘The stimulation of his sensory receptors is all the evidence anybody has had to go on, ultimately, in arriving at his picture of the world. Why not just see how this construction really proceeds? Why not settle for psychology?’ (Quine 1977: 75). Such naturalistic epistemology – in Quine’s own formulation, ‘naturalized epistemology’ – has been extended to moral epistemology. ‘A naturalized moral epistemology is simply a naturalized epistemology that concerns itself with moral knowledge’ (Campbell and Hunter 2000: 1). There is such a thing, too, as naturalized aesthetics: the attempt to use science to solve aesthetical problems (McMahon 2007). Other forms of empirical philosophy include neurophilosophy, which applies methods from neuroscience, and sometimes computer science, to questions in the philosophy of mind.
Naturalized epistemology has been criticized for being insufficiently normative. How can descriptions of epistemic mechanisms determine license for belief? The difficulty seems especially pressing in the case of moral epistemology. Wittgenstein’s complaint against naturalistic aesthetics – a view he called ‘exceedingly stupid’ – may intend a similar point. ‘The sort of explanation one is looking for when one is puzzled by an aesthetic impression is not a causal explanation, not one corroborated by experience or by statistics as to how people react’ (all Wittgenstein 1966: 17, 21). A wider disquiet about metaphilosophical naturalism is this: it presupposes a controversial view explicitly endorsed by Quine, namely that science alone provides true or good knowledge (Glock 2003a: 28, 46). For that reason and for others, some philosophers, including Wittgenstein, are suspicious even of scientifically-informed philosophy of mind.
Now the experimentalists – the philosophers who actually do science – tend to use science not to propose new philosophical ideas or theories but rather to investigate existing philosophical claims. The philosophical claims at issue are based upon intuitions, intuitions being something like ‘seemings’ or spontaneous judgments. Sometimes philosophers have employed intuitions in support of empirical claims. For example, some ethicists have asserted, from their philosophical armchairs, that character is the most significant determinant of action. Another example: some philosophers have speculated that most people are ‘incompatibilists’ about determinism. (The claim in this second example is, though empirical, construable as a certain type of second-order intuition, namely, as a claim that is empirical, yet made from the armchair, about the intuitions that other people have.) Experimentalists have put such hunches to the test, often concluding that they are mistaken (see Levin 2009 and Levy 2009). At other times, though, the type of intuitively-based claim that experimentalists investigate is non-empirical or at least not evidently empirical. Here one finds, for instance, intuitions about what counts as knowledge, about whether some feature of something is necessary to it (recall Kripke, above), about what the best resolution of a moral dilemma is, and about whether or not we have free will. Now, experimentalists have not quite tested claims of this second sort. But they have used empirical methods in interrogating the ways in which philosophers, in considering such claims, have employed intuitions. Analytic philosophers have been wont to use their intuitions about such non-empirical matters to establish burdens of proof, to support premises, and to serve as data against which to test philosophical theories. But experimentalists have claimed to find that, at least in the case of non-philosophers, intuitions about such matters vary considerably. (See for instance Weinberg, Nichols and Stitch 2001.) So, why privilege the intuitions of some particular philosopher?
Armchair philosophers have offered various responses. One is that philosophers’ intuitions diverge from ‘folk’ intuitions only in this way: the former are more considered versions of the latter (Levin 2009). But might not such considered intuitions vary among themselves? Moreover: why at all trust even considered intuitions? Why not think – with Quine (and William James, Richard Rorty, Nietzsche, and others) that intuitions are sedimentations of culturally or biologically inherited views? A traditional response to that last question (an ‘ordinary language response’ and equally, perhaps, ‘an ideal language’ response) runs as follows. Intuitions do not convey views of the world. Rather they convey an implicit knowledge of concepts or of language. A variation upon that reply gives it a more naturalistic gloss. The idea here is that (considered) intuitions, though indeed ‘synthetic’ and, as such, defeasible, represent good prima facie evidence for the philosophical views at issue, at least if those views are about the nature of concepts (see for instance Graham and Horgan 1994).
The original or classical pragmatists are the North Americans C.S. Peirce (1839–1914), William James (1842–1910), John Dewey (1859–1952) and, perhaps, G. H. Mead. The metaphilosophy of pragmatism unfolds from that which became known as ‘the pragmatic maxim’.
Peirce invented the pragmatic maxim as a tool for clarifying ideas. His best known formulation of the maxim runs thus: ‘Consider what effects, which might conceivably have practical bearings, we conceive the object of our conception to have. Then, our conception of these effects is the whole of our conception of the object’ (Peirce 1931-58, volume 5: section 402). Sometimes the maxim reveals an idea to have no meaning. Such was the result, Peirce thought, of applying the maxim to transubstantiation, and, indeed, to many metaphysical ideas. Dewey deployed the maxim similarly. He saw it ‘as a method for inoculating ourselves against certain blind alleys in philosophy’ (Talisse and Aikin 2008: 17). James construed the maxim differently. Whereas Peirce seemed to hold that the ‘effects’ at issue were, solely, effects upon sensory experience, James extended those effects into the psychological effects of believing in the idea(s) in question. Moreover, whereas Peirce construed the maxim as a conception of meaning, James turned it into a conception of truth. ‘“The true”’ is that which, ‘in almost any fashion’, but ‘in the long run and on the whole’, is ‘expedient in the way of our thinking’ (James 1995: 86). As a consequence of these moves, James thought that many philosophical disputes were resolvable, and were only resolvable, through the pragmatic maxim.
None of the pragmatists opposed metaphysics as such or as a whole. That may be because each of them held that philosophy is not fundamentally different to other inquiries. Each of Peirce, James and Dewey elaborates the notion of inquiry, and the relative distinctiveness of philosophy, in his own way. But there is common ground on two views. (1) Inquiry is a matter of coping. Dewey, and to an extent James, understand inquiry as an organism trying to cope with its environment. Indeed Dewey was considerably influenced by Darwin. (2) Experimental science is the exemplar of inquiry. One finds this second idea in Dewey but also and especially in Peirce. The idea is that experimental science is the best method or model of inquiry, be the inquiry practical or theoretical, descriptive or normative, philosophical or non-philosophical. ‘Pragmatism as attitude represents what Mr. Peirce has happily termed the “laboratory habit of mind” extended into every area where inquiry may fruitfully be carried on’ (Dewey 1998, volume 2: 378). Each of these views (that is, both 1 and 2) may be called naturalistic (the second being a version of metaphilosophical naturalism; q.v. section 2.e).
According to pragmatism (though Peirce is perhaps an exception) pragmatism was a humanism. Its purpose was to serve humanity. Here is James (1995: 2): ‘no one of us can get along without the far-flashing beams of light it sends over the world’s perspectives’, the ‘it’ here being pragmatist philosophy and also philosophy in general. James held further that pragmatism, this time in contrast with some other philosophies, allows the universe to appear as ‘a place in which human thoughts, choices, and aspirations count for something’ (Gallie 1952: 24). As to Dewey, he held the following. ‘Ideals and values must be evaluated with respect to their social consequences, either as inhibitors or as valuable instruments for social progress’; and ‘philosophy, because of the breadth of its concern and its critical approach, can play a crucial role in this evaluation’ (Dewey, section 4). Indeed, according to Dewey, philosophy is to be ‘a social hope reduced to a working programme of action, a prophecy of the future, but one disciplined by serious thought and knowledge’ (Dewey 1998, vol. 1: 72). Dewey himself pursued such a programme, and not only in his writing – in which he championed a pervasive form of democracy – but also (and to help enable such democracy) as an educationalist.
Humanism notwithstanding, pragmatism was not hostile to religion. Dewey could endorse religion as a means of articulating our highest values. James tended to hold that the truth of religious ideas was to be determined, at the broadest level, in the same way as the truth of anything else. Peirce, for his part, was a more traditional philosophical theist. The conceptions of religion advocated by James and Dewey have been criticized for being very much reconceptions (Talisse and Aikin 2008: 90–94). A broader objection to pragmatist humanism is that its making of man the measure of all things is false and even pernicious. One finds versions of that objection in Heidegger and Critical Theory. One could level the charge, too, from the perspective of environmental ethics. Rather differently, and even more broadly, one might think that ‘moral and political ambitions’ have no place ‘within philosophy proper’ (Glock 2003a: 22 glossing Quine). Objections of a more specific kind have targeted the pragmatic maxim. Critics have faulted Peirce’s version of the pragmatic maxim for being too narrow or too indeterminate; and Russell and others have criticized James' version as a misanalysis of what we mean by ‘true’.
Pragmatism was superseded (most notably in the United States) or occluded (in those places where it took little hold in the first place) by logical positivism. But the metaphilosophy of logical positivism has important similarities to pragmatism’s. Positivism’s verifiability principle is very similar to Peirce’s maxim. The positivists held that science is the exemplar of inquiry. And the positivists, like pragmatism, aimed at the betterment of society. Note also that positivism itself dissolved partly because its original tenets underwent a ‘“pragmaticization”’ (Rorty 1991b: xviii). That pragmaticization was the work especially of Quine and Davidson, who are ‘logical pragmatists’ in that they use logical techniques to develop some of the main ideas of pragmatists (Glock 2003a: 22–3; see also Rynin 1956). The ideas at issue include epistemological holism and the underdetermination of various type of theory by evidence. The latter is the aforementioned (section 2.d.iii) pragmatic element within Quine’s approach to ontology (on which see further Quine’s Philosophy of Science, section 3).
The label ‘neopragmatism’ has been applied to Robert Brandom, Susan Haack, Nicholas Rescher, Richard Rorty, and other thinkers who, like them, identify themselves with some part(s) of classical pragmatism. (Karl-Otto Apel, Jürgen Habermas, John McDowell, and Hilary Putnam are borderline cases; each takes much from pragmatism but is wary about ‘pragmatist’ as a self-description.) This section concentrates upon the best known, most controversial, and possibly the most metaphilosophical, of the neopragmatists: Rorty.
Much of Rorty’s metaphilosophy issues from his antirepresentationalism. Antirepresentationalism is, in the first instance, this view: no representation (linguistic or mental conception) corresponds to reality in a way that exceeds our commonsensical and scientific notions of what it is to get the world right. Rorty’s arguments against the sort of privileged representations that are at issue here terminate or summarize as follows. ‘[N]othing counts as justification unless by reference to what we already accept [...] [T]here is no way to get outside our beliefs and our language so as to find some test other than coherence’ (Rorty 1980: 178). Rorty infers that ‘the notion of “representation,” or that of “fact of the matter,”’ has no ‘useful role in philosophy’ (Rorty 1991b: 2). We are to conceive ourselves, or our conceptions, not as answerable to the world, but only to our fellows (see McDowell 2000: 110).
Rorty thinks that antirepresentationalism entails the rejection of a metaphilosophy which goes back to the Greeks, found a classic expression in Kant, and which is pursued in Analytic philosophy. That metaphilosophy, which Rorty calls ‘epistemological’, presents philosophy as ‘a tribunal of pure reason, upholding or denying the claims of the rest of culture’ (Rorty 1980: 4). More fully: philosophy judges discourses, be they religious, scientific, moral, political, aesthetical or metaphysical, by seeing which of them, and to what degree, disclose reality as it really is. (Clearly, though, more needs to be said if this conception is to accommodate Kant’s ‘transcendental idealism’. See Kant: Metaphysics, section 4.)
Rorty wants the philosopher to be, not a ‘cultural overseer’ adjudicating types of truth claims, but an ‘informed dilettante’ and a ‘Socratic intermediary’ (Rorty 1980: 317). That is, the philosopher is to elicit ‘agreement, or, at least, exciting and fruitful disagreement’ (Rorty 1980: 318) between or within various types or areas of discourse. Philosophy so conceived Rorty calls ‘hermeneutics’. The Rortian philosopher does not seek some schema allowing two or more discourses to be translated perfectly one to the other (an idea Rorty associates with representationalism). Instead she inhabits hermeneutic circle. ‘[W]e play back and forth between guesses about how to characterize particular statements or other events, and guesses about the point of the whole situation, until gradually we feel at ease with what was hitherto strange’ (1980: 319). Rorty connects this procedure to the ‘edification’ that consists in ‘finding new, better, more interesting, more fruitful ways of speaking’ (p. 360) and, thereby, to a goal he calls ‘existentialist’: the goal of finding new types of self-conception and, in that manner, finding new ways to be.
Rorty’s elaboration of all this introduces further notable metaphilosophical views. First: ‘Blake is as much of a philosopher Fichte and Henry Adams more of a philosopher than Frege’ (Rorty 1991a: xv). For Sellars was right, Rorty believes, to define philosophy as ‘an attempt to see how things, in the broadest possible sense of the term, hang together, in the broadest possible sense of the term’ (Sellars 1963: 1; compare section 6, Sellars’ Philosophy of Mind; presumably, though, Rorty holds that one has good philosophy when such attempts prove ‘edifying’). Second: what counts as a philosophical problem is contingent, and not just in that people only discover certain philosophical problems at certain times. Third: philosophical argument, at least when it aspires to be conclusive, requires shared assumptions; where there are no or few shared assumptions, such argument is impossible.
The last of the foregoing ideas is important for what one might call Rorty’s practical metaphilosophy. Rorty maintains that one can argue about morals and/or politics only with someone with whom one shares some assumptions. The neutral ground that philosophy has sought for debates with staunch egoists and unbending totalitarians is a fantasy. All the philosopher can do, besides point that out, is to create a conception that articulates, but does not strictly support, his or her moral or political vision. The philosopher ought to be ‘putting politics first and tailoring a philosophy to suit’ (Rorty 1991b: 178) – and similarly for morality. Rorty thinks that no less a political philosopher than John Rawls has already come close to this stance (Rorty 1991b: 191). Nor does Rorty bemoan any of this. The ‘cultural politics’ which suggests ‘changes in the vocabularies deployed in moral and political deliberation’ (Rorty 2007: ix) is more useful than the attempt to find philosophical foundations for some such vocabulary. The term ‘cultural politics’ could mislead, though. Rorty does not advocate an exclusive concentration on cultural as against social or economic issues. He deplores the sort of philosophy or cultural or literary theory that makes it ‘almost impossible to clamber back down [...] to a level [...] on which one might discuss the merits of a law, a treaty, a candidate, or a political strategy’ (Rorty 2007: 93).
Rorty’s metaphilosophy, and the philosophical views with which it is intertwined, have been attacked as irrationalist, self-refuting, relativist, unduly ethnocentric, complacent, anti-progressive, and even as insincere. Even Rorty’s self-identification with the pragmatist tradition has been challenged (despite the existence of at least some clear continuities). So have his readings, or appropriations, of his philosophical heroes, who include not only James and Dewey but also Wittgenstein, Heidegger and, to a lesser extent, Davidson and Derrida. For a sample of all these criticisms, see Brandom 2000 (which includes replies by Rorty) and Talisse and Aikin 2008: 140–148.
‘Post-Analytic philosophy’ is a vaguely-defined term for something that is a current rather than a group or school. The term (in use as early as Rajchman and West 1985) denotes the work of philosophers who owe much to Analytic philosophy but who think that they have made some significant departure from it. Often the departures in question are motivated by pragmatist allegiance or influence. (Hence the placing of this section.) The following are all considerably pragmatist and are all counted as post-Analytic philosophers: Richard Rorty; Hilary Putnam; Robert Brandom; John McDowell. Still, those same figures exhibit, also, a turn to Hegel (a turn rendered slightly less remarkable by Hegel’s influence upon Peirce and especially upon Dewey). Some Wittgensteinians count as post-Analytic too, as might the later Wittgenstein himself. Stanley Cavell stands out here, though in one way or another Wittgenstein strongly influenced most of philosophers mentioned in this paragraph. Another common characteristic of those deemed post-Analytic is interest in a range of ‘Continental’ thinkers. Rorty looms large here. But there is also the aforementioned interest in Hegel, and, for instance, the fact that one finds McDowell citing Gadamer.
Post-Analytic philosophy is associated with various more or less metaphilosophical views. One is the rejection or severe revision of any notion of philosophical analysis. Witness Rorty, Brandom’s self-styled ‘analytic pragmatism’, and perhaps, metaphilosophical naturalism (q.v. section 2.e). (Still: only rarely – as in Graham and Horgan 1994, who advocate what they call ‘Post-Analytic Metaphilosophy’ – do naturalists call themselves ‘post-Analytic’.) Some post-Analytic philosophers go further, in that they tend, often under the influence of Wittgenstein, to attempt less to solve and more to dissolve or even discard philosophical problems. Each of Putnam, McDowell and Rorty has his own version of this approach, and each singles out for dissolution the problem of how mind or language relates to the world. A third characteristic feature of post-Analytic philosophy is the rejection of a certain kind of narrow professionalism. That sort of professionalism is preoccupied with specialized problems and tends to be indifferent to broader social and cultural questions. One finds a break from such narrow professionalism in Cavell, in Rorty, in Bernard Williams, and to an extent in Putnam (although also in such "public" Analytic philosophers as A. C. Grayling).
Moreover, innovative or heterodox style is something of a criterion of post-Analytic philosophy. One thinks here especially of Cavell. But one might mention McDowell too. Now, one critic of McDowell faults him for putting ‘barriers of jargon, convolution, and metaphor before the reader hardly less formidable than those characteristically erected by his German luminaries’ (Wright 2002: 157). The criticism betokens the way in post-Analytic philosophers are often regarded, namely as apostates. Post-Analytic philosophers tend to defend themselves by arguing either that Analytic philosophy needs to reconnect itself with the rest of culture, and/or that Analytic philosophy has itself shown the untenability of some of its most central assumptions and even perhaps ‘come to the end of its own project—the dead end’ (Putnam 1985: 28).
Phenomenology, as pursued by Edmund Husserl describes phenomena. Phenomena are things in the manner in which they appear. That definition becomes more appreciable through the technique through which Husserl means to gain access to phenomena. Husserl calls that technique the epoche (a term that owes to Ancient Greek skepticism). He designates the perspective that it achieves – the perspective that presents one with ‘phenomena’ – ‘the phenomenological reduction’. The epoche consists in suspending ‘the natural attitude’ (another term of Husserl’s coinage). The natural attitude comprises assumptions about the causes, the composition, and indeed the very existence of that which one experiences. The epoche, Husserl says, temporarily ‘brackets’ these assumptions, or puts them ‘out of play’ – allowing one to describe the world solely in the manner in which it appears. That description is phenomenology.
Phenomenology means to have epistemological and ontological import. Husserl presents the epistemological import – to begin with that – in a provocative way: ‘If “positivism” is tantamount to an absolutely unprejudiced grounding of all sciences on the “positive,” that is to say, on what can be seized upon originaliter, then we are the genuine positivists’ (Husserl 1931: 20). The idea that Husserl shares with the positivists is that experience is the sole source of knowledge. Hence Husserl’s ‘principle of all principles’: ‘whatever presents itself in “intuition” in primordial form [...] is simply to be accepted as it gives itself out to be, but obviously only within the limits in which it thus presents itself’ (Husserl 1931: section 24). However, and like various other philosophers (including William James and the German Idealists), Husserl thinks that experience extends beyond what empiricism makes of it. For one thing – and this reveals phenomenology’s intended ontological import – experience can be of essences. A technique of ‘imaginative variation’ similar to Descartes' procedure with the wax (see Descartes, section 4) allows one to distinguish that which is essential to a phenomenon and, thereby, to make discoveries about the nature of such phenomena as numbers and material things. Now, one might think that this attempt to derive essences from phenomena (from things in the manner in which they appear) must be idealist. Indeed – and despite the fact that he used the phrase ‘to the things themselves!’ as his slogan – Husserl did avow a ‘transcendental idealism’, whereby ‘transcendental subjectivity [...] constitutes sense and being’ (Husserl 1999: section 41). However, the exact content of that idealism – i.e. the exact meaning of the phrase just quoted – is a matter of some interpretative difficulty. It is evident enough, though, that Husserl's idealism involves (at least) the following ideas. Experience necessarily involves various ‘subjective achievements’. Those achievements comprise various operations that Husserl calls ‘syntheses’ and which one might (although here one encounters difficulties) call 'mental'. Moreover, the achievements are attributable to a subjectivity that deserves the name 'transcendental' in that (1) the achievements are necessary conditions for our experience, (2) the subjectivity at issue is transcendent in this sense: it exists outside the natural world (and, hence, cannot entirely be identified with what we normally construe as the mind). (On the notion of the transcendental, see further Kant’s transcendental idealism and transcendental arguments.)
Husserl argued that the denial of transcendental subjectivity ‘decapitates philosophy’ (Husserl 1970: 9). He calls such philosophy ‘objectivism’ and asserts that it confines itself to the ‘universe of mere facts’ and allies itself with the sciences. (Thus Husserl employs ‘positivism’ and ‘naturalism’ as terms with similar import to ‘objectivism’.) But objectivism cannot even understand science itself, according to Husserl; for science, he maintains, presupposes the achievements of transcendental subjectivity. Further, objectivism can make little sense of the human mind, of humanity’s place within nature, and of values. These latter failings contribute to a perceived meaninglessness to life and a ‘fall into hostility toward the spirit and into barbarity’ (Husserl 1970: 9). Consequently, and because serious investigation of science, mind, our place in nature, and of values belongs to Europe’s very raison d’être, objectivism helps to cause nothing less than a ‘crisis of European humanity’ (Husserl 1970: 299). There is even some suggestion (in the same text) that objectivism prevents us from experiencing people as people: as more than mere things.
The foregoing shows that phenomenology has a normative aspect. Husserl did make a start upon a systematic moral philosophy. But phenomenology is intrinsically ethical (D. Smith 2003: 4–6), in that the phenomenologist eschews prejudice and seeks to divine matters for him- or herself.
Husserl hoped to found a unified and collaborative movement. His hope was partially fulfilled. Heidegger, Sartre and Merleau-Ponty count as heirs to Husserl because (or mainly because) they believed in the philosophical primacy of description of experience. Moreover, many of the themes of post-Husserlian phenomenology are present already, one way or other, in Husserl. But there are considerable, and indeed metaphilosophical, differences between Husserl and his successors. The metaphilosophical differences can be unfolded from this: Heidegger, Sartre and Merleau-Ponty adhere to an ‘existential’ phenomenology. ‘Existential phenomenology’ has two senses. Each construal matters metaphilosophically.
In one sense, ‘existential phenomenology’ denotes phenomenology that departs from Husserl’s self-proclaimed ‘pure’ or ‘transcendental’ phenomenology. At issue here is this view of Husserl’s: it is logically possible that a consciousness could survive the annihilation of everything else (Husserl 1999: section 13). Existential phenomenologists deny the view. For they accept a kind of externalism whereby experience, or the self, is what it is – and not just causally – by dint of the world that is experienced. (On externalism, see Philosophy of Language, section 4a and Mental Causation, section 3.b.ii.) Various slogans and terms within the work existential phenomenologists express these views. Heidegger’s Being and Time presents the human mode of being as ‘being-in-the-world’ and speaks not of ‘the subject’ or ‘consciousness’ but of ‘Da-sein’ (‘existence’ or, more literally, ‘being-there’). Merleau-Ponty asserts that we are ‘through and through compounded of relationships with the world’, ‘destined to the world’ (2002: xi–xv). In Being and Nothingness, Sartre ‘parenthesiz[es] the word “of” when referring, say, to “consciousness (of) a table” [in order] to reject the “reificatory” idea of consciousness as some thing or container distinct from the world in the midst of which we are conscious’ (Cooper 1999: 201).
Existential phenomenology, so construed, has metaphilosophical import because it affects philosophical (phenomenological) method. Being and Nothingness holds that the inseparability of consciousness from the objects of consciousness ruins Husserl’s method of epoche (Sartre 1989: part one, chapter one; Cerbone 2006: 1989). Merleau-Ponty may not go as far. His Phenomenology of Perception has it that, because we are ‘destined to the world’, ‘The most important lesson of the reduction is the impossibility of a complete reduction’ (2002: xv). But the interpretation of this remark is debated (see J Smith 2005). At any rate – though this is one of the things that an interpreter of his stance on the reduction has to reckon with – Merleau-Ponty found a greater philosophical use for the empirical sciences than did Husserl. Heidegger was more inclined to keep the sciences in their place. But he too – partly because of his existential (externalist) conception of phenomenology – differed from Husserl on the epoche. Again, however, Heidegger’s precise position is hard to discern. (Caputo 1977 describes the interpretative problem and tries to solve it.) Still, Heidegger’s principal innovation in philosophical method has little to do with the epoche. This article considers that innovation before turning to the other sense of existential phenomenology.
Heidegger’s revisions of phenomenological method place him within the hermeneutic tradition. Hermeneutics is the art or practice of interpretation. The hermeneutic tradition (sometimes just called ‘hermeneutics’) is a tradition that gives great philosophical weight to an interpretative mode of understanding. Members of this tradition include Friedrich Schleiermacher (1768–1834), Wilhelm Dilthey (1833–1911) and, after Heidegger, Hans-Georg Gadamer (1900–2002) and Paul Ricœur. Heidegger is hermeneutical in that he holds the following. All understanding is interpretative in that it always has preconceptions. One has genuine understanding insofar as one has worked through the relevant preconceptions. One starts ‘with a preliminary, general view of something; this general view can guide us to insights, which then lead – should lead – to a revised general view, and so on’ (Polt 1999: 98). This ‘hermeneutic circle’ has a special import for phenomenology. For (according to Heidegger) our initial understanding of our relations to the world involves some particularly misleading and stubborn preconceptions, some of which derive from philosophical tradition. Heidegger concludes that what is necessary is ‘a destruction—a critical process in which the traditional concepts, which at first must necessarily be employed, are deconstructed down to the [experiential, phenomenological] sources from which they were drawn’ (Heidegger 1988: 22f.). But Heidegger’s position may be insufficiently, or inconsistently, hermeneutical. The thought is that Heidegger’s own views entail a thesis that, subsequently, Gadamer propounded explicitly. Namely: ‘The very idea of a definitive interpretation [of anything] seems to be intrinsically contradictory’ (Gadamer 1981: 105). This thesis, which Gadamer reaches by conceiving understanding as inherently historical and linguistic, bodes badly for Heidegger’s aspiration to provide definitive ontological answers (an aspiration that he possessed at least as much as Husserl did). Yet arguably (compare Mulhall 1996: 192–5) that very result gels with another of Heidegger’s goals, namely, to help his readers to achieve authenticity (on which more momentarily).
The second meaning or construal of ‘existential phenomenology’ is existentialism. Gabriel Marcel invented that latter term for ideas held by Sartre and by Simone de Beauvoir. Subsequently, Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, Camus, Karl Jaspers, Kafka, and others, got placed under the label. A term used so broadly is hard to define precisely. But the following five theses each have a good claim to be called ‘existentialist’. Indeed: each of the major existential phenomenologists held some version of at least most of the theses (although, while Sartre came to accept the label ‘existentialist’, Heidegger did not).
These theses indicate that for the existentialist philosophy must be practical. It is not, though, that existentialism puts ethics at the heart of philosophy. That is because a further central existentialist idea is that no-one, even in principle, can legislate values for another. True, Sartre declared freedom to be ‘the foundation of all values’ (Sartre 2007: 61); and he wrote Notebooks for an Ethics. According to the ethic in question, to will one’s own freedom is to will the freedom of others. But in no further way does that ethic make much claim to objectivity. Instead, much of it turns upon the ‘good faith’ that consists in not denying the fact of one’s freedom.
What of politics? Little in Husserl fits a conventional understanding of political philosophy. Sartre came to hold that his existential ethics made sense only for a society that had been emancipated by Marxism (Sartre 1963: xxv-xxvi). Merleau-Ponty developed a phenomenologically informed political philosophy – and disagreed with Sartre on concrete political questions and on the manner in which the philosopher should be ‘engaged’ (Diprose and Reynolds: ch. 8; Carmen and Hansen 2005: ch. 12). Sartre and Merleau-Ponty give one to think, also, about the idea of artistic presentations of philosophy (Diprose and Reynolds: ch.s 9 and 18). What of Heidegger? He was, of course, a Nazi, although for how long – how long after he led the ‘Nazification’ of Freiburg University – is debated, as is the relation between his Nazism and his philosophy (Wolin 1993; Young 1997; see also section 4.c below). Now the ‘Heidegger case’ raises, or makes more urgent, some general metaphilosophical issues. Should philosophers get involved in politics? And was Gilbert Ryle right to say - as allegedly, apropos Heidegger, he did say (Cohen 2002: 337 n. 21), - that ‘a shit from the heels up can’t do good philosophy’?
The foregoing material indicates a sense in which phenomenology is its own best critic. Indeed, some reactions against phenomenology and existentialism as such – against the whole or broad conception of philosophy embodied they represent – owe to apostates or to heterodox philosophers within those camps. We saw that, in effect, Sartre came to think that existentialism was insufficient for politics. In fact, he came to hold this: ‘Every philosophy is practical, even the one which at first sight appears to be the most contemplative [. . . Every philosophy is] a social and political weapon’ (Sartre 1960: 5). Levinas accused phenomenologists prior to himself of ignoring an absolutely fundamental ethical dimension to experience (see Davis 1996). Derrida resembles Sartre and Levinas, in that, like them, he developed his own metaphilosophy (treated below) largely via internal criticism of phenomenology. Another objection to phenomenology is that it collapses philosophy into psychology or anthropology. (Husserl himself criticized Heidegger in that way.) Rather differently, some philosophers hold that, despite its attitude to naturalism, phenomenology needs to be naturalized (Petitot et al 1999). As to existentialism, it has been criticized for ruining ethics and for propounding an outlook that is not only an intellectual mistake but also – and Heidegger is taken as the prime exhibit – politically dangerous (see Adorno 1986 and ch. 8 of Wolin).
‘Critical Theory’ names the so-called Frankfurt School – the tradition associated with the Institute of Social Research (Institutfürsozialforschung) which was founded in Frankfurt in 1924. (See Literary Theory section 1 for a wider or less historical notion of Critical Theory.) According to Critical Theory, the point of philosophy is that it can contribute to a critical and emancipatory social theory. The specification of that idea depends upon which Critical Theory is at issue; Critical Theory is an extended and somewhat diverse tradition. Its first generation included Theodor Adorno, Max Horkheimer and Herbert Marcuse. Most of the members of this generation had Jewish backgrounds. For that reason, and because the Institute was Marxist, the first generation fled the Nazis. The Institute re-opened in Frankfurt in 1950. Within the second generation, the most prominent figures are Jürgen Habermas and Albrecht Wellmer. Within the third, Axel Honneth is the best known. There is a fourth generation too. Moreover, there were stages or phases within the first generation (Dubiel 1985). To wit: ‘materialism’, 1930–1937; ‘Critical Theory’, 1937–1940; ‘critique of instrumental reason’, 1940–1945; and a proto-stage wherein Critical Theory was more traditionally Marxist than it was subsequently. What follows can consider only some of these versions of Critical Theory.
The term ‘the critical theory of society’ (‘Critical Theory’ for short) was introduced only in 1937. It was introduced by Horkheimer, who was director of the Institute at the time. He introduced it partly from prudence. By 1937 the Institute was in the United States, wherein it was unwise for the Institute to call itself Marxist or even to continue to call itself ‘materialist’. But prudence was not the only motive for the new name. Horkheimer meant to clarify and shape the enterprise he was leading. According to Horkheimer (1947), Critical Theory is social theory that is, first of all, broad. It treats society as a whole or in all its aspects. That breadth, together with the idea that society is more independent of the economy than traditional Marxism recognizes, means that Critical Theory must be interdisciplinary. (The expertise of the first-generation encompassed economics, sociology, law, politics, psychology, aesthetics and philosophy.) Next, Critical Theory is emancipatory. It aims at a society that is rational and free and which meets the needs of all. It is to that end that Critical Theory is critical. It means to reveal how contemporary capitalist society, in its economy and its culture and in their interplay, deceives and dominates.
Critical Theory so defined involves philosophy in several ways. (1) From its inception, it adapted philosophical ideas, especially from German Idealism, in order to analyze society. Nonetheless, and following Lukács, (2) Critical Theory thought that some parts of some philosophies could be understood as unknowing reflection of social conditions. (3) Philosophy tends to enter not as the normative underpinning of the theory but in justification for the lack of such underpinning. Horkheimer and company little specified the rational society they sought and little defended the norms by which they indicted contemporary society. With Marx, they held that one should not legislate for what should be the free creation of the future. With Hegel, they held that, anyway, knowledge is conditioned by its time and place. They held also, and again in Hegelian fashion, that there are norms that exist (largely unactualized) within capitalism – norms of justice and freedom and so forth – which suffice to indict capitalism. (4) Critical Theory conceives itself as philosophy’s inheritor. Philosophy, especially post-Kantian German Idealism, had tried to overcome various types of alienation. But only the achievement of a truly free society could actually do that, according to Critical Theory. Note lastly here that, at least after 1936, Critical Theory denied both that ostensibly Marxist regimes were such and that emancipation was anywhere nearly at hand. Consequently, this stage of Critical Theory tended to aim less at revolution and more at propagating awareness of the faults of capitalism and (to a lesser extent) of ‘actually existing socialism’.
There is a sense in which philosophy looms larger (or even larger) in the next phase of the first generation of Critical Theory. For this phase of the moment propounded that which we might call (with a nod to Lyotard) a (very!) grand narrative. Adorno and Horkheimer are the principle figures of this phase, and their co-authored Dialectic of Enlightenment its main text. That text connects enlightenment to that which Max Weber had called ‘the disenchantment of the world’. To disenchant the world is to render it calculable. The Dialectic traces disenchantment from the historical Enlightenment back to the proto-rationality of myth and forward to modern industrial capitalism (to its economy, psychology, society, politics, and even to its philosophies). Weber thought that disenchantment had yielded a world wherein individuals were trapped within an ‘iron cage’ (his term) of economy and bureaucracy. Here is the parallel idea in the Dialectic. Enlightenment has reverted to myth, in that the calculated world of contemporary capitalism is ruled, as the mythic world was ruled, by impersonal and brutish forces. Further analysis in the Dialectic introduces ‘instrumental reason’. That term owes to Horkheimer’s Eclipse of Reason, which is something of a popularization of the Dialectic. The Dialectic itself speaks of ‘subjective reason’. Disenchantment produces a merely instrumental reason in that it pushes choice among ends outside of the purview of rationality. That said, the result – Horkheimer and Adorno argue – is a kind of instrumentalization of ends. Ends get replaced, as a kind of default, by things previously regarded merely instrumentally. Thus, at least or especially by the time of contemporary capitalism, life comes to be governed by such means-become-ends as profit, technical expertise, systematization, distraction, and self-preservation.
Do these ideas really amount to Critical Theory? Perhaps they are too abstract to count as interdisciplinary. Worse: they might seem to exclude any orientation towards emancipation. True, commentators show that Adorno offered more practical guidance than was previously thought. Also, first-generation Critical Theory, including the critique of instrumental reason, did inspire the 1960s student movement. However: while Marcuse responded to that movement with some enthusiasm, Adorno and Horkheimer did not. Perhaps they could not. For though they fix their hopes upon reason (upon ‘enlightenment thinking’), they indict that very same thing. They write (2002: xvi):
We have no doubt—and herein lies our petitio principii—that freedom in society is inseparable from enlightenment thinking. We believe we have perceived with equal clarity, however, that the very concept of that thinking, no less than the concrete historical forms, the institutions of society with which it is intertwined, already contains the germ of the regression.
Habermas is a principal source of the criticisms of Adorno and Horkheimer just presented. (He expresses the last of those criticisms by speaking of a ‘performative contradiction’.) Nonetheless, or exactly because he thinks that his predecessors have failed to make good upon the conception, Habermas pursues Critical Theory as Horkheimer defined it, which is to say, as broad, interdisciplinary, critical, and emancipatory social theory.
Habermas' Critical Theory comprises, at least centrally, his ‘critique of functionalist reason’, which is a reworking of his predecessors’ critique of instrumental reason. The central thesis of the critique of functionalist reason is that the system has colonized the lifeworld. In order to understand the thesis, one needs to understand not only the notions of system, lifeworld, and colonization but also the notion of communicative action and – this being the most philosophical notion of the ensemble – the notion of communicative rationality.
Communicative action is action that issues from communicative rationality. Communicative rationality consists, roughly, in ‘free and open discussion [of some issue] by all relevant persons, with a final decision being dependent upon the strength of better argument, and never upon any form of coercion’ (Edgar 2006: 23). The lifeworld comprises those areas of life that exhibit communicative action (or, we shall see, which could and perhaps should exhibit it). The areas at issue include the family, education, and the public sphere. A system is a social domain wherein action is determined by more or less autonomous or instrumental procedures rather than by communicative rationality. Habermas counts markets and bureaucracies as among the most significant systems. So the thesis that the lifeworld has been colonized by the system is the following claim. The extension of bureaucracy and markets into areas such as the family, education, and the public sphere prevent those spheres from being governed by free and open discussion.
Habermas uses his colonization thesis to explain alienation, social instability, and the impoverishment of democracy. He maintains, further, that even systems cannot function if colonization proceeds beyond a certain point. The thinking runs thus. Part of the way in which systems undermine communicative action is by depleting resources (social, cultural and psychological) necessary for such action. But systems themselves depend upon those resources. (Note that, sometimes, Habermas uses the term ‘lifeworld’ to refer to those resources themselves rather than to a domain that does or could exhibit communicative action.) Still: Habermas makes it relatively clear that the colonization thesis is meant not only as descriptive but also as normative. For consider the following. (1) A ‘critique’ – as in ‘critique of functional reason’ – is, at least in its modern usage, an indictment. (2) Habermas presents the creation of a ‘communicative’ lifeworld as essential to the completion – a completion that he deems desirable – of what he calls ‘the unfinished project of modernity’. (3) Habermas tells us (in his Theory of Communicative Action, which is the central text for the colonization thesis) that he means to provide the normative basis for a critical theory of society.
How far does Habermas warrant the normativity, which is to say, show that colonization is bad? It is hard to be in favour of self-undermining societies. But (some degree of?) alienation might be thought a price worth paying for certain achievements; and not everyone advocates democracy (or at least the same degree or type of it). But Habermas does have the following argument for the badness of colonization. There is ‘a normative content’ within language itself, in that ‘[r]eaching understanding is the inherent telos of human speech’; and/but a colonized lifeworld, which by definition is not a domain of communicative action, thwarts that telos. (Habermas 1992a: 109 and Habermas 1984: 287 respectively.)
The idea that language has a communicative telos is the crux of Habermas’ thought. For it is central both to his philosophy of language (or to his so-called universal pragmatics) and to his ethics. To put the second of those points more accurately: the idea of a communicative telos is central to his respective conceptions of both ethics and morality. Habermas understands morality to be a matter of norms that are mainly norms of justice and which are in all cases universally-binding. Ethics, by contrast, is a matter of values, where those values: express what is good for some individual or some group; have no authority beyond the individual or group concerned; and are trumped by morality when they conflict with it. Habermas has a principle, derived from the linguistic, communicative telos mentioned above, which he applies to both normal norms and ethical values. To wit: a norm or value is acceptable only if all those affected by it could accept it in reasonable – rational and uncoerced – discourse. This principle makes morality and ethics matters not for the philosopher but ‘for the discourse between citizens’ (Habermas 1992a: 158). (For more on Habermas’ moral philosophy – his ‘discourse ethics’, as it is known – and on his political philosophy, and also on the ways in which the various aspects of his thought fit together, see Finlayson 2005. Note, too, that in the twenty-first century Habermas has turned his attention to (1) that which religion can contribute to the public discourse of secular states and (2) bioethics.)
Habermas’ denial that philosophers have special normative privileges is part of his general (meta)philosophical orientation. He calls that orientation ‘postmetaphysical thinking’. In rejecting metaphysics, Habermas means to reject not only a normative privilege for philosophy but also the idea that philosophy can ‘make claims about the world as a whole’ (Dews 1995: 209). Habermas connects postmetaphysical thinking to something else too. He connects it to his rejection of that which he calls ‘the philosophy of consciousness’. Habermas detects the philosophy of consciousness in Descartes, in German Idealism, and in much other philosophy besides. Seemingly a philosophy counts as a philosophy of consciousness, for Habermas, just in case it holds this: the human subject apprehends the world in an essentially individual and non-linguistic way. To take Habermas’ so-called ‘communicative turn’ is to reject that view; it is to hold, instead, that human apprehension is at root both linguistic and intersubjective. Habermas believes that Wittgenstein, Mead, and others prefigured and even somewhat accomplished this ‘paradigm shift’ (Habermas 1992a: 173, 194).
Habermasian postmetaphysical thinking has been charged both with retaining objectionable metaphysical elements and with abandoning too many of philosophy's aspirations. (The second criticism is most associated with Karl-Otto Apel, who nonetheless has co-operated with Habermas in developing discourse ethics. On the first criticism, see for instance Geuss 1981: 94f.) Habermas has been charged, also, with making Critical Theory uncritical. The idea here is this. In allowing that it is alright for some markets and bureaucracies to be systems, Habermas allows too much. (A related but less metaphilosophical issue, touched on above, is whether Habermas has an adequate normative basis for its social criticisms. This issue is an instance of the so-called normativity problem in Critical Theory, on which see Freyenhagen 2008; Finlayson 2009.)
Here are two further metaphilosophical issues. (1) Is it really tenable or desirable for philosophy to be as intertwined with social science as Critical Theory wishes it to be? (For an affirmative answer, see Geuss 2008.) (2) Intelligibility seems particularly important for any thinker who means ‘to reduce the tension between his own insight and the oppressed humanity in whose service he thinks’ (Horkheimer 1937: 221); but Critical Theory has been criticized as culpably obscure and even as mystificatory (see especially the pieces by Popper and Albert in Adorno et al 1976). Adorno has been the principal target for such criticisms (and Adorno did defend his style; see Joll 2009). Yet Habermas, too, is very hard to interpret. That is partly because this philosopher of communication exhibits an ‘unbelievable compulsion to synthesize’ (Knödler-Bunte in Habermas 1992a: 124), which is to say, to combine seemingly disparate – and arguably incompatible – ideas.
‘The later Heidegger’ is the Heidegger of, roughly, the 1940s onwards. (Some differences between ‘the two Heideggers’ will emerge below. But hereafter normally ‘Heidegger’ will mean ‘the later Heidegger’.) Heidegger’s difficult, radical, and influential metaphilosophy holds that: philosophy is metaphysics; metaphysics involves a fundamental mistake; metaphysics is complicit in modernity’s ills; metaphysics is entering into its end; and ‘thinking’ should replace metaphysics/philosophy.
Heidegger’s criterion of metaphysics – to start with that – is the identification of being with beings. To explain: metaphysics seeks something designatable as ‘being’ in that metaphysics seeks a principle or ground of beings; and metaphysics identifies being with beings in that it identifies this principle or ground (i.e. being) with something that it itself a being – or at least a cause or property of some being or beings. Heidegger's favored examples of such construals of being include: the Idea in Plato; Aristotelian or Cartesian or Lockean ‘substance’; various construals of God; the Leibnizian ‘monad’; Husserlian subjectivity; and the Nietzschean ‘will to power’. Philosophy is co-extensive with metaphysics in that all philosophy since Plato involves such a project of grounding.
Now Heidegger himself holds that beings (das Seiende) have a dependence upon being (das Sein). Yet, being is ‘not God and not a cosmic ground’ (Heidegger 1994: 234). Indeed, being is identical to no being or being(s) or property or cause of any being(s) whatsoever. This distinction is ‘the ontological difference—the differentiation between being and beings’ (Heidegger 1982: 17; this statement is from Heidegger's earlier work, but this idea, if not quite the term, persists). We may put the contention thus: pace metaphysics/philosophy, being is not ontic. But what, then, is being?
It may be that Heidegger employs ‘das Sein’ in two senses (Young 2002: ch. 1, Philipse 1998: section 13b; compare for instance Caputo 1993: 30). We might (as do Young and Philipse) use 'being', uncapitalized, to refer to the first of these sense and 'Being' (capitalized) to refer to the other. (Where both senses are in play, as sometimes they seem to be in Heidegger's writing, this article resorts sometimes to the German das Sein. Note, however, that this distinction between two senses of Heideggerian Sein is interpretatively controversial.) In the first and as it were lowercase sense, being is what Heidegger calls sometimes a 'way of revealing'. That is, it is something – something ostensibly non-ontic – by dint of which beings are 'revealed' or 'unconcealed' or 'come to presence', and indeed do so in the particular way or ways in which they do. In the second and 'uppercase' sense, Being is that which is responsible for unconcealment, i.e. is responsible for das Sein in the first, lowercase sense. A little more specifically, Being (in this second, uppercase sense) ‘sends’ or ‘destines’ being; accordingly, it is that from which beings are revealed, the ‘reservoir of the non-yet-uncovered, the un-uncovered’ (Heidegger 1971: 60). With this second notion of das Sein, Heidegger means to stress the following point (a point that perhaps reverses a tendency in the early Heidegger): humanity does not determine, at least not wholly, how beings are ‘unconcealed’.
One wants specification of all this. We shall see that Heidegger provides some. Nevertheless, it may be a mistake to seek an exact specification of the ideas at issue. For Heidegger may not really mean das Sein (in either sense) to explain anything. He may mean instead to stress the mysteriousness of the fact that beings are accessible to us in the form that they are and, indeed, at all.
One way in which Heidegger fills out the foregoing ideas is by posit ing ‘epochs’ of being, which is to say, a historical series of ontological regimes (and here lies another difference between the earlier and the later Heidegger). The series runs thus: (1) the ancient Greek understanding of being, with which Heidegger associates the word ‘physis’; (2) the Medieval Christian understanding of being, whereby beings (except God and artifacts) are divinely created things; (3) the modern understanding of being as resource (on which more below). That said, sometimes Heidegger gives a longer list of epochs, in which list the epochs correlate with metaphysical systems. Thus the idea of a ‘history of being [Seinsgeschichte] as metaphysics’ (Heidegger 2003: 65). It is important that this history, and indeed the simpler tripartite scheme, does not mean to be a history merely of conceptions of being. It means to be also a history of being itself, i.e. of ontological regimes. Heidegger holds, then, that beings are 'unconcealed' in different ways in different epochs (although he holds also that each metaphysic ‘absolutizes’ its corresponding ontological regime, i.e. that each metaphysic overlooks the fact that beings are unconcealed differently in different epochs; see Young 2002: 29, 54, 68).
Heidegger allows also for some ontological heterogeneity within epochs, too. Here one encounters Heidegger’s notion of ‘the thing’ (das Ding). Trees, hills, animals, jugs, bridges, and pictures can be Things in the emphatic sense at issue, but such Things are ‘modest in number, compared with the countless objects’. A Thing has ‘a worlding being’. It opens a world by ‘gathering’ the fourfold (das Geviert). The fourfold is a unity of ‘earth and sky, divinities and mortals’. (All Heidegger 1971: 179ff.). Some of this conception is actually fairly straightforward. Heidegger tries to show how a bridge (to take one case) can be so interwoven with human life and thereby with other entities that, via the ‘world’ that comprises those interrelations (a world not identical with any particular being), the following is the case. The Thing (the bridge), persons, and numerous other phenomena all stand in relations of mutual determination, i.e. make each other what they are.
But in modernity ontological variety is diminished, according to Heidegger. In modernity Things become mere objects. Indeed subsequently objects themselves, together with human beings, become mere resources. A resource (or 'standing-reserve'; the German is Bestand) is something that, unlike an object, is determined wholly by a network of purposes into which we place it. Heidegger’s examples include a hydroelectric powerplant on the Rhine and an airplane, together with the electricity and fuel systems to which those artifacts are connected. Heidegger associates resources with modern science and with ‘the metaphysics of subjectivity’ within which (he argues) modern science moves. That metaphysics, which tends towards seeing man as the measure of all things, is in fact metaphysics as such, according to Heidegger. For anthropocentrism is incipient in the very beginnings of philosophy, blossoms in various later philosophers including Descartes and Kant, and reaches its apogee in Nietzsche, the extremity of whose anthropocentrism is the end of metaphysics. It is the end of metaphysics (or, pleonastically: of the metaphysics of subjectivity) in that here, in Nietzsche's extreme anthropocentrism, metaphysics reaches its completion or full unfolding. And that end reflects the reign of resources. ‘[T]he world of completed metaphysics can be stringently called “technology”’ (Heidegger 2003: 82). However, in Heidegger’s final analysis the ubiquity of resources owes not to science or metaphysics but to a ‘mode of revealing’; it owes to an epochal ontological regime that Heidegger calls ‘Enframing’, even if he seems to think, also, that a change in human beings could mitigate Enframing and prepare for something different and better. (More on this mitigation shortly.)
What though is wrong with the real being revealed as resource? Enframing is ‘monstrous’ (Heidegger 1994: 321). It is monstrous – Heidegger contends – because it is nihilism. Nihilism is a ‘forgetfulness’ of das Sein (Seinsvergessenheit). Some such forgetfulness is nigh inevitable. We are interested in beings as they present themselves to us. So we overlook the conditions of that presentation, namely, being and Being. But Enframing represents a more thoroughgoing form of forgetfulness. The hegemony of resources makes it very hard (harder than usual – recall above) to conceive that beings could be otherwise, which is to say, to conceive that there is something called ‘Being’ that could yield different regimes of being. In fact, Enframing actively denies being/Being. That is because Enframing, or the metaphysics/science that corresponds to it, proceeds as if humanity were the measure of all things and hence as if being, or that which grants being independently of us (Being), were nothing. Such nihilism sounds bearable. But Heidegger lays much at its door: an impoverishment of culture; a deep kind of homelessness; the devaluation of the highest values (see Young 2002: ch. 2 and passim). He goes so far as to trace ‘the events of world history in this [the twentieth] century’ to Seinsvergessenheit (Heidegger in Wolin 1993: 69).
Heidegger’s response to nihilism is ‘thinking’ (Denken). The thinking at issue is a kind of thoughtful questioning. Its object – that which it thinks about – can be the pre-Socratic ideas from which philosophy developed, or philosophy’s history, or Things, or art. Whatever its object, thinking always involves recognition that it is das Sein, albeit in some interplay with humanity, which determines how beings are. Indeed, Heideggerian thinking involves wonder and gratitude in the face of das Sein. Heidegger uses Meister Eckhart’s notion of ‘releasement’ to elaborate upon such thinking. The idea (prefigured, in fact, in Heidegger’s earlier work) is of a non-impositional comportment towards beings which lets beings be what they are. That comportment ‘grant[s] us the possibility of dwelling in the world in a totally different way’. It promises ‘a new ground and a new foundation upon which we can stand and endure in the world of technology without being imperiled by it’ (Heidegger 1966: 55). Heidegger calls the dwelling at issue ‘poetic’ and one way in which he specifies it is via various poets. Moreover, some of Heidegger’s own writing is semi-poetic. A small amount of it actually consists of poems. So it is not entirely surprising to find Heidegger claiming that, ‘All philosophical thinking' is 'in itself poetic’ (Heidegger 1991, vol. 2: 73; Heidegger made this claim at a time when he still considered himself a philosopher as against a non-metaphysical, and hence non-philosophical, ‘thinker’). The claim is connected to the centrality that Heidegger gives to language, a centrality that is summed up (a little gnomically) in the statement that language is ‘the house of das Sein’ (Heidegger 1994: 217).
Heideggerian ‘thinking’ has been attacked as (some mixture of) irrationalist, quietist, reactionary, and authoritarian (see for example Adorno 1973 and Habermas 1987b: ch. 6). A related objection is that, though Heidegger claimed to leave theology alone, what he produced was an incoherent reworking of religion (Haar 1993; Philipse 1998). Of the more or less secular or (in Caputo’s term) ‘demythologized’ construals of Heidegger, many are sympathetic and, among those, many fasten upon such topics as technology, nihilism, and dwelling (Borgmann 1984, Young 2002: ch.s 7–9; Feenberg 1999: ch. 8). Other secular admirers – including, notably, Rorty and Derrida – concentrate upon Heidegger’s attempt to encapsulate and interrogate the entire philosophical tradition.
Structuralism was an international trend in linguistics, literary theory, anthropology, political theory, and other disciplines. It sought to explain phenomena (sounds, tropes, behaviors, norms, beliefs . . .) less via the phenomena themselves, or via their genesis, and more via structures that the phenomena exist within or instantiate. The post-structuralists applied this structural priority to philosophy. They are post-structuralists less because they came after structuralism and more because, in appropriating structuralism, they distanced themselves from the determinism and scientism it often involved (Dews 1987: 1–4). The post-structuralists included Deleuze, Foucault, Lyotard and Lacan (and sometimes post-structuralism is associated with ‘post-modernism’; see Malpas 2003: 7–11). Each of these thinkers (perhaps excepting Lacan) is highly metaphilosophical. But attention is restricted to the best known and most controversial of the post-structuralists, namely, Jacques Derrida.
Derrida practiced ‘deconstruction’ (Déconstruire, la Déconstruction; Derrida adapts the notion of deconstruction from Heidegger's idea of 'destruction', on which latter see section 4.a.ii above). Deconstruction is a ‘textual “operation”’ (Derrida 1987: 3). The notion of text here is a broad one. It extends from written texts to conceptions, discourses, and even practices. Nevertheless, Derrida's early work concentrates upon actual texts and, more often than not, philosophical ones. The reason Derrida puts ‘operation’ (‘textual “operation”’) within scare-quotes is that he holds that deconstruction is no method. That in turn is for two reasons (each of which should become clearer below). First, the nature of deconstruction varies with that which is deconstructed. Second, there is a sense in which texts deconstruct themselves. Nonetheless: deconstruction, as a practice, reveals such alleged self-deconstruction; and that practice does have a degree of regularity. The practice of deconstruction has several stages. (In presenting those stages, ‘text’ is taken in the narrow sense. Moreover, it is presumed that in each case a single text is, at least centrally, at issue.)
Deconstruction begins with a commentary (Derrida 1976: 158) - with a ‘faithful’ and ‘interior’ reading of a text (Derrida 1987: 6). Within or via such commentary, the focus is upon metaphysical oppositions. Derrida understands metaphysics as ‘the metaphysics of presence’ (another notion adapted from Heidegger); and an opposition belongs to metaphysics (pleonastically, the metaphysics of presence) just in case: (i) it contains a privileged term and a subordinated term; and (ii) the privileged term has to do with presence. ‘Presence’ is presence to consciousness and/or the temporal present. The oppositions at issue include not only presence–absence (construed in either of the two ways just indicated) but also, and among others (and with the term that is privileged within each opposition given first) these: ‘normal/abnormal, standard/parasitic, fulfilled/void, serious/nonserious, literal/nonliteral’ (Derrida 1988: 93).
The next step in deconstruction is to show that the text undermines its own metaphysical oppositions. That is: the privileged terms reveal themselves to be less privileged over the subordinate terms – less privileged vis-à-vis presence, less ‘simple, intact, normal, pure, standard, self-identical’ (Derrida 1988: 93) – than they give themselves out to be. Here is a common way in which Derrida tries to establish the point. He tries to show that a privileged term essentially depends upon, or shares some crucial feature(s) with, its supposed subordinate. One of Derrida’s deconstructions of Husserl can serve as an example. Husserl distinguishes mental life, which he holds to be inherently intentional (inherently characterized by aboutness) from language, which is intentional only via contingent association with such states. Thereby Husserl privileges the mental over the linguistic. However: Husserl’s view of the temporality of experience entails that the presence he makes criterial for intrinsic intentionality – a certain presence of meanings to the mind – is always partially absent. Or so Derrida argues (Derrida, section 4). A second strategy of Derrida’s ‘is to apply a distinction onto itself reflexively and thus show that it itself is imbued with the disfavored term’ (Landau, 1992/1993: 1899). ‘For example, Derrida shows that when Aristotle and other philosophers discuss the nature of metaphors (and thereby the distinction between metaphors and non-metaphors), they use metaphors in the discussions themselves’ (idem) – and so fail in their attempts to relegate or denigrate metaphor. A further strategy involves the notion of undecidability (see Derrida, section 5).
A third stage or aspect of deconstruction is, one can say, less negative or more productive (and Derrida himself calls this the productive moment of deconstruction). Consider Derrida’s deconstruction(s) of the opposition between speech and writing. Derrida argues, initially, as follows. Speech – and even thought, understood as a kind of inner speech – shares with writing features that have often been used to present writing as only a poor descendent of speech. Those features include being variously interpretable and being derivative of something else. But there is more. Derrida posits something, which he calls archi-écriture, ‘arche-writing’, which is ‘fundamental to signifying processes in general, a “writing” that is the condition of all forms of expression, whether scriptural, vocal, or otherwise’ (Johnson 1993: 66). Indeed: as well as being a condition of possibility, arche-writing is, in Derrida’s frequent and arresting phrase, a condition of its impossibility. Arche-writing establishes or reveals a limit to any kind of expression (a limit, namely, to the semantic transparency, and the self-sufficiency, of expressions). Other deconstructions proceed similarly. A hierarchical opposition is undermined; a new term is produced through a kind of generalization of the previously subordinate term; and the new term – such as ‘supplement’, ‘trace’ and the neologism différance (Derrida, section 3.c–e) – represents a condition of possibility and impossibility for the opposition in question.
What is the status of these conditions? Sometimes Derrida calls them ‘quasi-transcendental’. That encourages this idea: here we have an account not just of concepts but of things or phenomena. Yet Derrida himself does not quite say that. He denies that we can make any simple distinction between text and world, between conceptual system and phenomena. Such may be part of the thrust of the (in)famous pronouncement, ‘There is nothing outside of the text’ (il n’y a pas de hors-texte; Derrida 1976: 158). Nor does Derrida think that, by providing such notions as arche-writing, he himself wholly evades the metaphysics of presence. ‘We have no language—no syntax and no lexicon—that is foreign to this history; we can pronounce not a single deconstructive proposition which has not already had to slip into the form, the logic, and the implicit postulations of precisely what it seeks to contest’ (Derrida 1990: 280f.). Still: ‘if no one can escape this necessity, and if no one is therefore responsible for giving in to it [...] this does not mean that all the ways of giving in to it are of equal pertinence. The quality and fecundity of a discourse are perhaps measured by the critical rigor with which this relation to the history of metaphysics and to inherited concepts is thought’ (Derrida 1990: 282).
Derrida retained the foregoing views, which he had developed by the end of the 1960s. But there were developments of metaphilosophical significance. (1) In the ’70s, his style became more playful, and his approach to others’ text became more literary (and those changes more or less persisted; Derrida would want to know, however, just what we understand by ‘playful’ and ‘literary’). (2) Again from the ’70s onwards, Derrida joined with others in order to: sustain and promote the teaching of philosophy in schools; to consider philosophy’s role; and to promote philosophy that transgressed disciplinary boundaries. (3) In the ’80s, Derrida tried to show that deconstruction had an ethical and political import. He turned to themes that included cosmopolitanism, decision, forgiveness, law, mourning, racism, responsibility, religion, and terrorism – and claimed, remarkably, that ‘deconstruction is justice’ (Derrida 1999: 15). To give just a hint of this last idea: ‘Justice is what the deconstruction of the law’ – an analysis of the law’s conditions of possibility and impossibility, of its presuppositions and limits – ‘means to bring about’, where ‘law’ means ‘legality, legitimacy, or legitimation (for example)’ (Caputo 1997: 131f.). (On some of these topics, see Derrida, section 7.) (4) By the ’90s, if not earlier, Derrida held that in philosophy the nature of philosophy is always and everywhere at issue (see for instance Derrida 1995: 411).
Despite his views about the difficulty of escaping metaphysics, and despite his evident belief in the critical and exploratory value of philosophy, Derrida has been attacked for undermining philosophy. Habermas provides an instance of the criticism. Habermas argued that Derrida erases the distinction between philosophy and literature. Habermas recognizes that Derrida means to be ‘simultaneously maintaining and relativizing’ the distinction between literature and philosophy (Habermas 1987b: 192). But the result, Habermas thinks, is an effacement of the differences between literature and philosophy. Habermas adds, or infers, that ‘Derrida does not belong to those philosophers who like to argue’ (Habermas 1987b: 193). Derrida objected to being called unargumentative. He objected, also, to Habermas' procedure of using other deconstructionists – those that Habermas deemed more argumentative – as the source for Derrida’s views.
Subsequently, Habermas and Derrida underwent something of a rapprochement. Little reconciliation was achieved in the so-called ‘Derrida affair’, wherein a collection of philosophers, angry that Derrida was to receive an honorary degree from Cambridge, alleged that Derrida ‘does not meet accepted standards of clarity or rigor’ (quoted Derrida 1995: 420; a detailed attack upon Derrida’s scholarship is Evans 1991).
There might be a sense in which Derrida is too rigorous. For he holds this: ‘Every concept that lays claim to any rigor whatsoever implies the alternative of “all or nothing”’ (Derrida 1988: 116). One might reject that view. Might it be, indeed, that Derrida insists upon rigid oppositions ‘in order to legitimate the project of calling them into question’ (Gerald Graff in Derrida 1988: 115)? One might object, also, that Derrida’s interrogation of philosophy is more abstract, more intangible, than most metaphysics. Something Levinas said apropos Derrida serves as a response. ‘The history of philosophy is probably nothing but a growing awareness of the difficulty of thinking’ (Levinas 1996: 55; compare Derrida 1995: 187f.). The following anxiety might persist. Despite Derrida’s so-called ethical and political ‘turns’, and despite the work he has inspired within he humanities, deconstruction little illuminates phenomena that are not much like anything reasonably designatable as a text (Dews 1987: 35). A more general version of the anxiety is that, for all the presentations of Derrida as ‘a philosopher of difference’, deconstruction obscures differences (Kearney 1984: 114; Habermas 1992a: 159).
Note that, in the case of many of the items that follow, the date given for a text is not the date of its first publication.
Article first published 17/11/2010. Last revised 06/10/2015.
Article printed from Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy: http://www.iep.utm.edu/con-meta/
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