Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

The Classical Theory of Concepts

The classical theory of concepts is one of the five primary theories of concepts, the other four being prototype or exemplar theories, atomistic theories, theory-theories, and neoclassical theories. The classical theory implies that every complex concept has a classical analysis, where a classical analysis of a concept is a proposition giving metaphysically necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for being in the extension across possible worlds for that concept. That is, a classical analysis for a complex concept C gives a set of individually necessary conditions for being a C (or conditions that must be satisfied in order to be a C) that together are sufficient for being a C (or are such that something’s satisfying every member of that set of necessary conditions entails its being a C). The classical view also goes by the name of “the definitional view of concepts,” or “definitionism,” where a definition of a concept is given in terms of necessary and jointly sufficient conditions.

This article provides information on the classical theory of concepts as present in the historical tradition, on concepts construed most generally, on the nature of classical conceptual analysis, and on the most significant of the objections raised against the classical view.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Background and Advantages of the Classical View
  2. Concepts in General
    1. Concepts as Semantic Values
    2. Concepts as Universals
    3. Concepts as Mind-Dependent or Mind-Independent
    4. Concepts as the Targets of Analysis
    5. The Classical View and Concepts in General
  3. Classical Analyses
    1. Necessary and Sufficient Conditions
    2. Logical Constitution
    3. Other Conditions on Classical Analyses
    4. Testing Candidate Analyses
    5. Apriority and Analyticity with respect to Classical Analyses
  4. Objections to the Classical View
    1. Plato’s Problem
    2. The Argument from Categorization
    3. Arguments from Vagueness
    4. Quine’s Criticisms
    5. Scientific Essentialist Criticisms
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Historical Background and Advantages of the Classical View

The classical view can be traced back to at least the time of Socrates, for in many of Plato’s dialogues Socrates is clearly seeking a classical analysis of some notion or other. In the Euthyphro, for instance, Socrates seeks to know the nature of piety: Yet what he seeks is not given in terms of, for example, a list of pious people or actions, nor is piety to be identified with what the gods love. Instead, Socrates seeks an account of piety in terms of some specification of what is shared by all things pious, or what makes pious things pious—that is, he seeks a specification of the essence of piety itself. The Socratic elenchus is a method of finding out the nature or essence of various kinds of things, such as friendship (discussed in the Lysis), courage (the Laches), knowledge (the Theatetus), and justice (the Republic). That method of considering candidate definitions and seeking counterexamples to them is the same method one uses to test candidate analyses by seeking possible counterexamples to them, and thus Socrates is in effect committed to something very much like the classical view of concepts.

One sees the same sort of commitment throughout much of the Western tradition in philosophy from the ancient Greeks through the present. Clear examples include Aristotle’s notion of a definition as “an account [or logos] that signifies the essence” (Topics I) by way of a specification of essential attributes, as well as his account of definitions for natural kinds in terms of genus and difference. Particular examples of classical-style analyses abound after Aristotle: For instance, Descartes (in Meditation VI) defines body as that which is extended in both space and time, and mind as that which thinks. Locke (in the Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Ch. 21) defines being free with respect to doing an action A as choosing/willing to do A where one’s choice is part of the cause of one’s actually doing A. Hume defines a miracle (in Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, §X) as an event that is both a violation of the laws of nature and caused by God. And so on. The classical view looks to be a presumption of the early analytic philosophers as well (with Wittgenstein being a notable exception). The classical view is present in the writings of Frege and Russell, and the view receives its most explicit treatment by that time in G.E. Moore’s Lectures on Philosophy and other writings. Moore gives a classical analysis of the very notion of a classical analysis, and from then on the classical view (or some qualified version of it) has been one of the pillars of analytic philosophy itself.

One reason the classical view has had such staying power is that it provides the most obvious grounding for the sort of inquiry within philosophy that Socrates began. If one presumes that there are answers to What is F?-type questions, where such questions ask for the nature of knowledge, mind, goodness, etc., then that entails that there is such a thing as the nature of knowledge, mind, goodness, etc. The nature of knowledge, for example, is that which is shared by all cases of knowledge, and a classical analysis of the concept of knowledge specifies the nature of knowledge itself. So the classical view fits neatly with the reasonable presumption that there are legitimate answers to philosophical questions concerning the natures or essences of things. As at least some other views of concepts reject the notion that concepts have metaphysically necessary conditions, accepting such other views is tantamount to rejecting (or at least significantly revising) the legitimacy of an important part of the philosophical enterprise.

The classical view also serves as the ground for one of the most basic tools of philosophy—the critical evaluation of arguments. For instance, one ground of contention in the abortion debate concerns whether fetuses have the status of moral persons or not. If they do, then since moral persons have the right not to be killed, generally speaking, then it would seem to follow that abortion is immoral. The classical view grounds the natural way to address the main contention here, for part of the task at hand is to find a proper analysis of the concept of being a moral person. If that analysis specifies features such that not all of them are had by fetuses, then fetuses are not moral persons, and the argument against the moral permissibility of abortion fails. But without there being analyses of the sort postulated by the classical view, it is far from clear how such critical analysis of philosophical arguments is to proceed. So again, the classical view seems to underpin an activity crucial to the practice of philosophy itself.

In contemporary philosophy, J. J. Katz (1999), Frank Jackson (1994, 1998), and Christopher Peacocke (1992) are representative of those who hold at least some qualified version of the classical view. There are others as well, though many philosophers have rejected the view (at least in part due to the criticisms to be discussed in section 4 below). The view is almost universally rejected in contemporary psychology and cognitive science, due to both theoretical difficulties with the classical view and the arrival of new theories of concepts over the last quarter of the twentieth century.

2. Concepts in General

The issue of the nature of concepts is important in philosophy generally, but most perspicuously in philosophy of language and philosophy of mind. Most generally, concepts are thought to be among those things that count as semantic values or meanings (along with propositions). There is also reason to think that concepts are universals (along with properties, relations, etc.), and what general theory of universals applies to concepts is thus a significant issue with respect to the nature of concepts. Whether concepts are mind-dependent or mind-independent is another such issue. Finally, concepts tend to be construed as the targets of analysis. If one then treats analysis as classical analysis, and holds that all complex concepts have classical analyses, then one accepts the classical view. Other views of concepts might accept the thesis that concepts are targets of analysis, but differ from the classical view over the sort of analysis that all complex concepts have.

a. Concepts as Semantic Values

As semantic values, concepts are the intensions or meanings of sub-sentential verbal expressions such as predicates, adjectives, verbs, and adverbs. Just as the sentence “The sun is a star” expresses the proposition that the sun is a star, the predicate “is a star” expresses the concept of being a star (or [star], to introduce notation to be used in what follows). Further, just as the English sentence “Snow is white” expresses the proposition that snow is white, and so does the German sentence “Schnee ist Weiss,” the predicates “is white” in English and “ist Weiss” in German both express the same concept, the concept of being white (or [white]). The intension or meaning of a sentence is a proposition. The intensions or meanings of many sub-sentential entities are concepts.

b. Concepts as Universals

Concepts are also generally thought to be universals. The reasons for this are threefold:

(1) A given concept is expressible using distinct verbal expressions. This can occur in several different ways. My uttering “Snow is white” and your uttering “Snow is white” are distinct utterances, and their predicates are distinct expressions of the same concept [white]. My uttering “Snow is white” and your uttering “Schnee ist Weiss” are distinct sentences with their respective predicates expressing the same concept ([white], again). Even within the same language, my uttering “Grisham is the author of The Firm” and your uttering “Grisham is The Firm’s author” are distinct sentences with distinct predicates, yet their respective predicates express the same concept (the concept [the author of The Firm], in this case).

(2) Second, different agents can possess, grasp, or understand the same concept, though such possession might come in degrees. Most English speakers possess the concept [white], and while many possess [neutrino], not many possess that concept to such a degree that one knows a great deal about what neutrinos themselves are.

(3) Finally, concepts typically have multiple exemplifications or instantiations. Many distinct things are white, and thus there are many exemplifications or instances of the concept [white]. There are many stars and many neutrinos, and thus there are many instances of [star] and [neutrino]. Moreover, distinct concepts can have the very same instances. The concepts [renate] and [cardiate] have all the same actual instances, as far as we know, and so does [human] and [rational animal]. Distinct concepts can also have necessarily all of the same instances: For instance, the concepts [triangular figure] and [trilateral figure] must have the same instances, yet the predicates “is a triangular figure” and “is a trilateral figure” seem to have different meanings.

As universals, concepts may be treated under any of the traditional accounts of universals in general. Realism about concepts (considered as universals) is the view that concepts are distinct from their instances, and nominalism is the view that concepts are nothing over and above, or distinct from, their instances. Ante rem realism (or platonism) about concepts is the view that concepts are ontologically prior to their instances—that is, concepts exist whether they have instances or not. In re realism about concepts is the view that concepts are in some sense “in” their instances, and thus are not ontologically prior to their instances. Conceptualism with respect to concepts holds that concepts are mental entities, being either immanent in the mind itself as a sort of idea, as constituents of complete thoughts, or somehow dependent on the mind for their existence (perhaps by being possessed by an agent or by being possessible by an agent). Conceptualist views also include imagism, the view (dating from Locke and others) that concepts are a sort of mental image. Finally, nominalist views of concepts might identify concepts with classes or sets of particular things (with the concept [star] being identified with the set of all stars, or perhaps the set of all possible stars). Linguistic nominalism identifies concepts with the linguistic expressions used to express them (with [star] being identified with the predicate “is a star,” perhaps). Type linguistic nominalism identifies concepts with types of verbal expressions (with [star] identified with the type of verbal expression exemplified by the predicate “is a star”).

c. Concepts as Mind-Dependent or Mind-Independent

On many views, concepts are things that are “in” the mind, or “part of” the mind, or at least are dependent for their existence on the mind in some sense. Other views deny such claims, holding instead that concepts are mind-independent entities. Conceptualist views are examples of the former, and platonic views are examples of the latter. The issue of whether concepts are mind-dependent or mind-independent carries great weight with respect to the clash between the classical view and other views of concepts (such as prototype views and theory-theories). If concepts are immanent in the mind as mental particulars, for instance, then various objections to the classical view have more force; if concepts exist independently of one’s ideas, beliefs, capacities for categorizing objects, etc., then some objections to the classical view have much less force.

d. Concepts as the Targets of Analysis

Conceptual analysis is of concepts, and philosophical questions of the form What is F? (such as “What is knowledge?,” “What is justice?,” “What is a person?,” etc.) are questions calling for conceptual analyses of various concepts (such as [knowledge], [justice], [person], etc.). Answering the further question “What is a conceptual analysis?” is yet another way to distinguish among different views of concepts. For instance, the classical view holds that all complex concepts have classical analyses, where a complex concept is a concept having an analysis in terms of other concepts. Alternatively, prototype views analyze concepts in terms of typical features or in terms of a prototypical or exemplary case. For instance, such a view might analyze the concept of being a bird in terms of such typical features as being capable of flight, being small, etc., which most birds share, even if not all of them do. A second sort of prototype theory (sometimes called “the exemplar view”) might analyze the concept of being a bird in terms of a most exemplary case (a robin, say, for the concept of being a bird). So-called theory-theories analyze a concept in terms of some internally represented theory about the members of the extension of that concept. For example, one might have an overall theory of birds, and the concept one expresses with one’s use of ‘bird’ is then analyzed in terms of the role that concept plays in that internally represented theory. Neoclassical views of concepts preserve one element of the classical view, namely the claim that all complex concepts have metaphysically necessary conditions (in the sense that, for example, being unmarried is necessary for being a bachelor), but reject the claim that all complex concepts have metaphysically sufficient conditions. Finally, atomistic views reject all notions of analysis just mentioned, denying that concepts have analyses at all.

e. The Classical View and Concepts in General

The classical view claims simply that all complex concepts have classical analyses. As such, the classical view makes no claims as to the status of concepts as universals, or as being mind-dependent or mind-independent entities. The classical view also is consistent with concepts being analyzable by means of other forms of analysis. Yet some views of universals are more friendly to the classical view than others, and the issue of the mind-dependence or mind-independence of concepts is of some importance to whether the classical view is correct or not. For instance, if concepts are identical to ideas present in the mind (as would be true on some conceptualist views), then if the contents of those ideas fail to have necessary and sufficient defining conditions, then the classical view looks to be false (or at least not true for all concepts). Alternatively, on platonic views of concepts, such a lack of available necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for the contents of our own ideas is of no consequence to the classical view, since ideas are not concepts according to platonic accounts.

3. Classical Analyses

There are two components to an analysis of a complex concept (where a complex concept is a concept that has an analysis in terms of other “simpler” concepts): The analysandum, or the concept being analyzed, and the analysans, or the concept that “does the analyzing.” For a proposition to be a classical analysis, the following conditions must hold:

(I) A classical analysis must specify a set of necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for being in the analysandum’s extension (where a concept’s extension is everything to which that concept could apply). (Other classical theorists deny that all classical analysis specify jointly sufficient conditions, holding instead that classical analyses merely specify necessary and sufficient conditions.)

(II) A classical analysis must specify a logical constitution of the analysandum.

Other suggested conditions on classical analysis are given below.

a. Necessary and Sufficient Conditions

Consider an arbitrary concept [F]. A necessary condition for being an F is a condition such that something must satisfy that condition in order for it to be an F. For instance, being male is necessary for being a bachelor, and being four-sided is necessary for being a square. Such characteristics specified in necessary conditions are shared by, or had in common with, all things to which the concept in question applies.

A sufficient condition for being an F is a condition such that if something satisfies that condition, then it must be an F. Being a bachelor is sufficient for being male, for instance, and being a square is sufficient for being a square.

A necessary and sufficient condition for being an F is a condition such that not only must a thing satisfy that condition in order to be an F, but it is also true that if a thing satisfies that condition, then it must be an F. For instance, being a four-sided regular, plane figure is both necessary and sufficient for being a square. That is, a thing must be a four-sided regular plane figure in order for it to be a square, and if a thing is a four-sided regular plane figure, then it must be a square. [The word "regular" means that all sides are the same length.]

Finally, for a concept [F], necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for being an F is a set of necessary conditions such that satisfying all of them is sufficient for being an F. The conditions of being four-sided and of being a regular figure are each necessary conditions for being a square, for instance, and the conjunction of them is a sufficient condition for being a square.

b. Logical Constitution

A classical analysis also gives a logical constitution of the concept being analyzed, in keeping with Moore’s idea that an analysis breaks a concept up into its components or constituents. In an analysis, it is the logical constituents that an analysis specifies, where a logical constituent of a concept is a concept entailed by that concept. (A concept entails another concept when being in the extension of the former entails being in the extension of the latter.) For instance, [four-sided] is a logical constituent of [square], since something’s being a square entails that it is four-sided.

For a logical constitution specified by a classical analysis, a logical constitution of a concept [F] is a collection of concepts, where each member of that collection is entailed by [F], and where [F] entails all of them taken collectively.

Most complex concepts will have more than one logical constitution, given that there are different ways of analyzing the same concept. For instance, “A square is a four-sided regular figure” expresses an analysis of [square], but so does “A square is a four-sided, closed plane figure having sides all the same length and having neighboring sides orthogonal to one another.” The first analysis gives one logical constitution for [square], and the second analysis seems to give another.

c. Other Conditions on Classical Analyses

In addition to conditions (I) and (II), other conditions on classical analyses have been proposed. Among them are the following:

(III) A classical analysis must not include the analysandum as either its analysans or as part of its analysans. That is, a classical analysis cannot be circular. “A square is a square” does not express an analysis, and neither does “A true sentence is a sentence that specifies a true correspondence between the proposition it expresses and the world.”

(IV) A classical analysis must not have its analysandum be more complex than its analysans. That is, while “A square is a four-sided regular figure” expresses an analysis, “A four-sided regular figure is a square” does not. While the latter sentence is true, it does not express an analysis of [four-sided regular figure]. The concept [four-sided regular figure] analyzes [square], not the other way around.

(V) A classical analysis specifies a precise extension of the concept being analyzed, in the sense of specifying for any possible particular whether it is definitely in or definitely not in that concept’s extension.

(VI) A classical analysis does not include any vague concepts in either its analysandum or its analysans.

The last two conditions concern vagueness. It might be thought that an analysis has to specify in some very precise way what is, and what is not, in that concept’s extension (condition (V)), and also that an expression of an analysis itself cannot include any vague terms (condition (VI)).

d. Testing Candidate Analyses

In seeking a correct analysis for a concept, one typically considers some number of so-called candidate analyses. A correct analysis will have no possible counterexamples, where such counterexamples might show a candidate analysis to be either too broad or too narrow. For instance, let

“A square is a four-sided, closed plane figure”

express a candidate analysis for the concept of being a square. This candidate analysis is too broad, since it would include some things as being squares that are nevertheless not squares. Counterexamples include any trapezoid or rectangle (that is not itself a square, that is).

On the other hand, the candidate analysis expressed by

“A square is a red four-sided regular figure”

is too narrow, as it rules out some genuine squares as being squares, as it is at least possible for there to be squares other than red ones. Assuming for sake of illustration that squares are the sorts of things that can be colored at all, a blue square counts as a counterexample to this candidate analysis, since it fails one of the stated conditions that a square be red.

It might be wondered as to why correct analyses have no possible counterexamples, instead of the less stringent condition that correct analyses have no actual counterexamples. The reason is that analyses are put forth as necessary truths. An analysis of a concept like the concept of being a mind, for instance, is a specification of what is shared by all possible minds, not just what is in common among those minds that actually happen to exist. Similarly, in seeking an analysis of the concept of justice or piety (as Socrates sought), what one seeks is not a specification of what is in common among all just actions or all pious actions that are actual. Instead, what one seeks is the nature of justice or piety, and that is what is in common among all possible just actions or pious actions.

e. Apriority and Analyticity with respect to Classical Analyses

Classical analyses are commonly thought to be both a priori and analytic. They look to be a priori since there is no empirical component essential to their justification, and in that sense classical analyses are knowable by reason alone. In fact, the method of seeking possible counterexamples to a candidate analysis is a paradigmatic case of justifying a proposition a priori. Classical analyses also appear to be analytic, since on the rough construal of analytic propositions as those propositions “true by meaning alone,” classical analyses are indeed that sort of proposition. For instance, “A square is a four-sided regular figure” expresses an analysis, and if “square” and “four-sided regular figure” are identical in meaning, then the analysis is true by meaning alone. On an account of analyticity where analytic propositions are those propositions where what is expressed by the predicate expression is “contained in” what is expressed in the subject expression, classical analyses turn out to be analytic. If what is expressed by “four-sided regular figure” is contained in what is expressed by “square,” then “A square is a four-sided regular figure” is such that the meaning of its predicate expression is contained in what its subject expresses. Finally, on an account of analyticity treating analytic propositions as those where substitution of codesignating terms yields a logical truth, classical analyses turn out to be analytic propositions once more. For since “square” and “four-sided regular figure” have the same possible-worlds extension, then substituting “square” for “four-sided regular figure” in “A square is a four-sided regular figure” yields “A square is a square,” which is a logical truth. (For a contrary view holding that analyses are synthetic propositions, rather than analytic, see Ackerman 1981, 1986, and 1992.)

4. Objections to the Classical View

Despite its history and natural appeal, in many circles the classical view has long since been rejected for one reason or another. Even in philosophy, many harbor at least some skepticism of the thesis that all complex concepts have classical analyses with the character described above. A much more common view is that some complex concepts follow the classical model, but not all of them. This section considers six fairly common objections to the classical view.

a. Plato’s Problem

Plato’s problem is that after over two and a half millennia of seeking analyses of various philosophically important concepts, few if any classical analyses of such concepts have ever been discovered and widely agreed upon as fact. If there are classical analyses for all complex concepts, the critics claim, then one would expect a much higher rate of success in finding such analyses given the effort expended so far. In fact, aside from ordinary concepts such as [bachelor] and [sister], along with some concepts in logic and mathematics, there seems to be no consensus on analyses for any philosophically significant concepts. Socrates’ question “What is justice?,” for instance, has received a monumental amount of attention since Socrates’ time, and while there has been a great deal of progress made with respect to what is involved in the nature of justice, there still is not a consensus view as to an analysis of the concept of justice. The case is similar with respect to questions such as “What is the mind?,” “What is knowledge?,” “What is truth?,” “What is freedom?,” and so on.

One might think that such an objection holds the classical view to too high a standard. After all, even in the sciences there is rarely universal agreement with respect to a particular scientific theory, and progress is ongoing in furthering our understanding of entities such as electrons and neutrinos, as well as events like the Big Bang—there is always more to be discovered. Yet it would be preposterous to think that the scientific method is flawed in some way simply because such investigations are ongoing, and because there is not universal agreement with respect to various theories in the sciences. So why think that the method of philosophical analysis, with its presumption that all complex concepts have classical analyses, is flawed in some way because of the lack of widespread agreement with respect to completed or full analyses of philosophically significant concepts?

Yet while there are disagreements in the sciences, especially in cases where a given scientific theory is freshly proposed, such disagreements are not nearly as common as they are in philosophy. For instance, while there are practicing scientists that claim to be suspicious of quantum mechanics, of the general theory of relativity, or of evolution, such detractors are extremely rare compared to what is nearly a unanimous opinion that those theories are correct or nearly correct. In philosophy, however, there are widespread disagreements concerning even the most basic questions in philosophy. For instance, take the questions “Are we free?” and “Does being free require somehow being able to do otherwise?” The first question asks for an analysis of what is meant by “free,” and the second asks whether being able to do otherwise is a necessary condition on being free. Much attention has been paid to such basic questions, and the critics of the classical view claim that one would expect some sort of consensus as to the answers to them if the concept of freedom really has a classical analysis. So there is not mere disagreement with respect to the answers to such questions, but such disagreements are both widespread and involve quite fundamental issues as well. As a result, the difficulty in finding classical analyses has led many to reject the classical view.

b. The Argument from Categorization

There are empirical objections to the classical view as well. The argument from categorization takes as evidence various data with respect to our sorting or categorizing things into various categories, and infers that such behavior shows that the classical view is false. The evidence shows that we tend not to use any set of necessary and sufficient conditions to sort things in to one category or another, where such sorting behavior is construed as involving the application of various concepts. It is not as if one uses a classical analysis to sort things into the bird category, for instance. Instead, it seems that things are categorized according to typical features of members of the category in question, and the reason for this is that more typical members of a given category are sorted into that category more quickly than less typical members of that same category. Robins are sorted into the bird category more quickly than eagles, for instance, and eagles are sorted into the bird category more quickly than ostriches. What this suggests is that if concepts are used for acts of categorization, and classical analyses are not used in all such categorization tasks, then the classical view is false.

One presumption of the argument is that when one sorts something into one category or another, one uses one’s understanding of a conceptual analysis to accomplish the task. Yet classical theorists might complain that this need not be the case. One might use a set of typical features to sort things into the bird category, even if there is some analysis not in terms of typical features that gives the essential features shared by all birds. In other words (as Rey (1983) points out), there is a difference between what it is to look like a bird and what it is to be a bird. An analysis of a concept gives the conditions on which something is an instance of that concept, and it would seem that a concept can have an analysis (classical or otherwise) even if agents use some other set of conditions in acts of categorization.

Whether this reply to the argument from categorization rebuts the argument remains to be seen, but many researchers in cognitive psychology have taken the empirical evidence from acts of categorization to be strong evidence against the classical view. For such evidence also serves as evidence in favor of a view of concepts in competition with the classical view: the so-called prototype view of concepts. According to the prototype view, concepts are analyzed not in terms of necessary and jointly sufficient conditions, but in terms of lists of typical features. Such typical features are not shared by all instances of a given concept, but are shared by at least most of them. For instance, a typical bird flies, is relatively small, and is not carnivorous. Yet none of these features is shared by all birds. Penguins don’t fly, albatrosses are quite large, and birds of prey are carnivores. Such a view of concepts fits much more neatly with the evidence concerning our acts of categorization, so such critics reject the classical view.

c. Arguments from Vagueness

Vagueness has also been seen as problematic for the classical view. For one might think that in virtue of specifying necessary and jointly sufficient conditions, a classical analysis thus specifies a precise extension for the concept being analyzed (where a concept C has a precise extension if and only if for all x, x is either definitely in the extension of C or definitely not in the extension of C). Yet most complex concepts seem not to have such precise extensions. Terms like “bald,” “short,” and “old” all seem to have cases where it is unclear whether the term applies or not. That is, it seems that the concepts expressed by those terms are such that their extensions are unclear. For instance, it seems that there is no precise boundary between the bald and the non-bald, the short and the non-short, and the old and the non-old. But if there are no such precise boundaries to the extensions for many concepts, and a classical analysis specifies such precise boundaries, then there cannot be classical analyses for what is expressed by vague terms.

Two responses deserve note. One reply on behalf of the classical view is that vagueness is not part of the world itself, but instead is a matter of our own epistemic shortcomings. We find unclear cases simply because we don’t know where the precise boundaries for various concepts lie. There could very well be a precise boundary between the bald and the non-bald, for instance, but we find “bald” to be vague simply because we do not know where that boundary lies. Such an epistemic view of vagueness would seem to be of assistance to the classical view, though such a view of vagueness needs a defense, particularly given the presence of other plausible views of vagueness. The second response is that one might admit the presence of unclear cases, and admit the presence of vagueness or “fuzziness” as a feature of the world itself, but hold that such fuzziness is mirrored in the analyses of the concepts expressed by vague terms. For instance, the concept of being a black cat might be analyzed in terms of [black] and [cat], even if “black” and “cat” are both vague terms. So classical theorists might reply that if the vagueness of a term can be mirrored in an analysis in such a way, then the classical view can escape the criticisms.

d. Quine’s Criticisms

A family of criticisms of the classical view is based on W.V.O. Quine’s (1953/1999, 1960) extensive attack on analyticity and the analytic/synthetic distinction. According to Quine, there is no philosophically clear account of the distinction between analytic and synthetic propositions, and as such there is either no such distinction at all or it does no useful philosophical work. Yet classical analyses would seem to be paradigmatic cases of analytic propositions (for example, [bachelors are unmarried males], [a square is a four-sided regular figure]), and if there are no analytic propositions then it seems there are no classical analyses. Furthermore, if there is no philosophically defensible distinction between analytic and synthetic propositions, then there is no legitimate criterion by which to delineate analyses from non-analyses. Those who hold that analyses are actually synthetic propositions face the same difficulty. If analyses are synthetic, then one still needs a principled difference between analytic and synthetic propositions in order to distinguish between analyses and non-analyses.

The literature on Quine’s arguments is vast, and suffice it to say that criticism of Quine’s arguments and of his general position is widespread as well. Yet even among those philosophers who reject Quine’s arguments, most admit that there remains a great deal of murkiness concerning the analytic/synthetic distinction, despite its philosophical usefulness. With respect to the classical view of concepts, the options available to classical theorists are at least threefold: Either meet Quine’s arguments in a satisfactory way, reject the notion that all analyses are analytic (or that all are synthetic), or characterize classical analysis in a way that is neutral with respect to the analytic/synthetic distinction.

e. Scientific Essentialist Criticisms

Scientific essentialism is the view that the members of natural kinds (like gold, tiger, and water) have essential properties at the microphysical level of description, and that identity statements between natural kind terms and descriptions of such properties are metaphysically necessary and knowable only a posteriori. Some versions of scientific essentialism include the thesis that such identity statements are synthetic. That such statements are a posteriori and synthetic looks to be problematic for the classical view. For sake of illustration, let “Water is H2O” express an analysis of what is meant by the natural kind term “water.” According to scientific essentialism, such a proposition is metaphysically necessary in that it is true in all possible worlds, but it is a necessary truth discovered via empirical science. As such, it is not discovered by the a priori process of seeking possible counterexamples, revising candidate analyses in light of such counterexamples, and so on. But if water’s being H2O is known a posteriori, this runs counter to the usual position that all classical analyses are a priori. Furthermore, given that what is expressed by “Water is H2O” is a posteriori, this entails that it is synthetic, rather than analytic as the classical view would normally claim.

Again, the literature is vast with respect to scientific essentialism, identity statements involving natural kind terms, and the epistemic and modal status of such statements. For classical theorists, short of denying the basic theses of scientific essentialism, some options that save some portion of the classical view include holding that the classical view holds for some concepts (such as those in logic and mathematics) but not others (such as those expressed by natural kind terms), or characterizing classical analysis in a way that is neutral with respect to the analytic/synthetic distinction. How successful such strategies would be remains to be seen, and such a revised classical view would have to be weighed against other theories of concepts that handle all complex concepts with a unified treatment.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Ackerman, D. F. 1981. “The Informativeness of Philosophical Analysis.” In P. French, et al. (Eds.), Midwest Studies in Philosophy, vol. 6. Minneapolis, Minnesota: University of Minnesota Press, 313-320.
  • Ackerman, D. F. 1986. “Essential Properties and Philosophical Analysis.” In P. French, et al. (Eds.), Midwest Studies in Philosophy, vol. 11. Minneapolis, Minnesota: University of Minnesota Press, 304-313.
  • Ackerman, D. F. 1992. “Analysis and Its Paradoxes.” In E. Ullman-Margalit (Ed.), The Scientific Enterprise: The Israel Colloquium Studies in History, Philosophy, and Sociology of Science, vol. 4. Norwell, Massachusetts: Kluwer.
  • Bealer, George. 1982. Quality and Concept. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Bealer, George. 1996. “A Priori Knowledge and the Scope of Philosophy.” Philosophical Studies 81, 121-142.
  • Bonjour, Laurence. 1998. In Defense of Pure Reason: A Rationalist Account of A Priori Justification. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Chalmers, David J. and Jackson, Frank. 2001. “Conceptual Analysis and Reductive Explanation” [On-line]. Available:
  • Donnellan, Keith. 1983. “Kripke and Putnam on Natural Kind Terms.” In C. Ginet and S. Shoemaker (Eds.), Knowledge and Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 84-104.
  • Fodor, Jerry A. 1998. Concepts: Where Cognitive Science Went Wrong. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry A., Garrett, M. F., Walker, E. C. T., and Parkes, C. H. 1980/1999. “Against Definitions.” In Margolis and Laurence 1999, 491-512.
  • Grice, H. P. and Strawson, P. F. 1956. “In Defense of a Dogma.” The Philosophical Review 65 (2), 141-158.
  • Hanna, Robert. 1998. “A Kantian Critique of Scientific Essentialism.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 58 (3), 497-528.
  • Harman, Gilbert. 1999. “Doubts About Conceptual Analysis.” In Gilbert Harman, Reasoning, Meaning, and Mind, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 138-143.
  • Jackson, Frank. 1994. “Armchair Metaphysics.” In M. Michael and J. O’Leary-Hawthorne (Eds.), Philosophy in Mind. Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Jackson, Frank. 1998. From Metaphysics to Ethics: A Defence of Conceptual Analysis. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Katz, J. J. 1999.
  • Keefe, Rosanna and Smith, Peter (Eds.). 1999. Vagueness: A Reader. Cambridge, Massachusetts: M.I.T. Press.
  • King, Jeffrey C. 1998. “What is a Philosophical Analysis?” Philosophical Studies 90, 155-179.
  • Kripke, Saul A. 1980. Naming and Necessity. Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press.
  • Kripke, Saul A. 1993. “Identity and Necessity.” In A. W. Moore, Meaning and Reference. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 162-191.
  • Langford, C. H. 1968. “The Notion of Analysis in Moore’s Philosophy.” In Schlipp 1968, 321-342.
  • Laurence, Stephen and Margolis, Eric. 1999. “Concepts and Cognitive Science.” In Margolis and Laurence 1999, 3-81.
  • Margolis, Eric and Laurence, Stephen (Eds.). 1999. Concepts: Core Readings. M.I.T. Press.
  • Moore, G. E. 1966. Lectures on Philosophy. Ed. C. Lewy. London: Humanities Press.
  • Moore, G. E. 1968. “A Reply to My Critics.” In Schlipp 1968, 660-677.
  • Murphy, Gregory L. 2002. The Big Book of Concepts. Cambridge: M.I.T. Press.
  • Peacocke, Christopher. 1992. A Study of Concepts. Cambridge: M.I.T. Press.
  • Pitt, David. 1999. “In Defense of Definitions.” Philosophical Psychology 12 (2), 139-156.
  • Plato. 1961a. The Collected Dialogues of Plato. Ed. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. Princeton, New Jersey: Princeton University Press.
  • Plato. 1961b. Euthyphro. Trans. L. Cooper. In Plato 1961a, 169-185.
  • Plato. 1961c. Laches. Trans. L. Cooper. In Plato 1961a, 123-144.
  • Plato. 1961d. Lysis. Trans. L. Cooper. In Plato 1961a, 145-168.
  • Plato. 1961e. Theatetus. Trans. L. Cooper. In Plato 1961a, 845-919.
  • Plato. 1992. Republic. Trans. G. M. A. Grube. Indianapolis, Indiana: Hackett.
  • Prinz, Jesse J. 2002. Furnishing the Mind: Concepts and Their Perceptual Basis. Cambridge: M.I.T. Press.
  • Putnam, Hilary. 1962. “It Ain’t Necessarily So.” Journal of Philosophy 59 (22), 658-671.
  • Putnam, Hilary. 1966. “The Analytic and the Synthetic.” In H. Feigl and G. Maxwell, eds., Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, vol. III. Minneapolis, Minnesota: University of Minnesota Press, 358-397. Putnam,
  • Hilary. 1970. “Is Semantics Possible?” In H. Keifer and M. Munitz, eds., Language, Belief, and Metaphysics. New York: State University of New York Press, 50-63.
  • Putnam, Hilary. 1975. “The Meaning of ‘Meaning’.” In Keith Gunderson (Ed.), Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, vol. VII. Minneapolis, Minnesota: University of Minnesota Press, 131-193.
  • Putnam, Hilary. 1983. “‘Two Dogmas’ Revisited.” In Hilary Putnam, Realism and Reason: Philosophical Papers, Volume 3. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 87-97.
  • Putnam, Hilary. 1990. “Is Water Necessarily H2O?” In James Conant (Ed.), Realism with a Human Face. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 54-79.
  • Quine, W. V. O. 1953/1999. “Two Dogmas of Empiricism.” In Margolis and Laurence 1999, 153-170.
  • Quine, W. V. O. 1960. Word and Object. Cambridge: The M.I.T. Press.
  • Ramsey, William. 1992. “Prototypes and Conceptual Analysis.” Topoi 11, 59-70.
  • Rey, Georges. 1983. “Concepts and Stereotypes.” Cognition 15, 237-262.
  • Rey, Georges. 1985. “Concepts and Conceptions: A Reply to Smith, Medin and Rips.” Cognition 19, 297-303.
  • Rosch, Eleanor. 1999. “Principles of Categorization.” In Margolis and Laurence 1999, 189-206.
  • Schlipp, P. (Ed.). 1968. The Philosophy of G. E. Moore. LaSalle, Illinois: Open Court.
  • Smith, Edward E. 1989. “Three Distinctions About Concepts and Categorization.” Mind and Language 4 (1, 2), 57-61.
  • Smith, Edward E., and Medin, Douglas L. 1981. Categories and Concepts. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Smith, Edward E. 1999. “The Exemplar View.” In Margolis and Laurence 1999, 207-221.
  • Smith, Edward E., Medin, Douglas L., and Rips, Lance J. 1984. “A Psychological Approach to Concepts: Comments on Rey’s ‘Concepts and Stereotypes.’” Cognition 17, 265-274.
  • Sosa, Ernest. 1983. “Classical Analysis.” Journal of Philosophy 80 (11), 695-710.
  • Stalnaker, Robert. 2001. “Metaphysics Without Conceptual Analysis.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 62 (3), 631-636.
  • Williamson, Timothy. 1994. Vagueness. New York: Routledge. Williamson, Timothy. 1999. “Vagueness and Ignorance.” In Keefe and Smith 1999, 265-280.

Author Information

Dennis Earl
Coastal Carolina University
U. S. A.

Last updated: October 14, 2005 | Originally published: