Better known in China as “Master Kong” (Chinese: Kongzi), Confucius was a fifth-century BCE Chinese thinker whose influence upon East Asian intellectual and social history is immeasurable. As a culturally symbolic figure, he has been alternately idealized, deified, dismissed, vilified, and rehabilitated over the millennia by both Asian and non-Asian thinkers and regimes. Given his extraordinary impact on Chinese, Korean, Japanese, and Vietnamese thought, it is ironic that so little can be known about Confucius. The tradition that bears his name – “Confucianism” (Chinese: Rujia) – ultimately traces itself to the sayings and biographical fragments recorded in the text known as the Analects (Chinese: Lunyu). As with the person of Confucius himself, scholars disagree about the origins and character of the Analects, but it remains the traditional source for information about Confucius’ life and teaching. Most scholars remain confident that it is possible to extract from the Analects several philosophical themes and views that may be safely attributed to this ancient Chinese sage. These are primarily ethical, rather than analytical-logical or metaphysical in nature, and include Confucius’ claim that Tian (“Heaven”) is aligned with moral order but dependent upon human agents to actualize its will; his concern for li (ritual propriety) as the instrument through which the family, the state, and the world may be aligned with Tian’s moral order; and his belief in the “contagious” nature of moral force (de), by which moral rulers diffuse morality to their subjects, moral parents raise moral children, and so forth.
Sources for the historical recovery of Confucius’ life and thought are limited to texts that postdate his traditional lifetime (551-479 BCE) by a few decades at least and several centuries at most. Confucius’ appearances in Chinese texts are a sign of his popularity and utility among literate elites during the Warring States (403-221 BCE), Qin (221-206 BCE), and Han (206 BCE-220 CE) periods. These texts vary in character and function, from collections of biographical and pedagogical fragments such as the Analects to dynastic histories and works by later Confucian thinkers.
The historical Confucius, born in the small state of Lu on the Shandong peninsula in northeastern China, was a product of the “Spring and Autumn Period” (770-481 BCE). We know him mostly from texts that date to the “Warring States Period” (403-221 BCE). During these eras, China enjoyed no political unity and suffered from the internecine warfare of small states, remnants of the once-great Zhou polity that collapsed after “barbarian” invasions in 771 BCE. For more than three hundred years after the alleged year of Confucius’ birth, the Chinese would fight each other for mastery of the empire lost by the Zhou. In the process, life became difficult, especially for the shi (“retainer” or “knight”) class, from which Confucius himself arose. As feudal lords were defeated and disenfranchised in battle and the kings of the various warring states began to rely on appointed administrators rather than vassals to govern their territories, these shi became lordless anachronisms and fell into genteel poverty and itinerancy. Their knowledge of aristocratic traditions, however, helped them remain valuable to competing kings, who wished to learn how to regain the unity imposed by the Zhou and who sought to emulate the Zhou by patterning court rituals and other institutions after those of the fallen dynasty.
Thus, a new role for shi as itinerant antiquarians emerged. In such roles, shi found themselves in and out of office as the fortunes of various patron states ebbed and flowed. Confucius is said to have held office for only a short time before withdrawing into scholarly retirement. While out of office, veteran shi might gather small circles of disciples – young men from shi backgrounds who wished to succeed in public life. It is precisely such master-and-disciple exchanges between Confucius and his students that the Analects claims to record.
Above all else, the Analects depicts Confucius as someone who “transmits, but does not innovate” (7.1). What Confucius claimed to transmit was the Dao (Way) of the sages of Zhou antiquity; in the Analects, he is the erudite guardian of tradition who challenges his disciples to emulate the sages of the past and restore the moral integrity of the state. Although readers of the Analects often assume that Confucius’ views are presented as a coherent and consistent system within the text, a careful reading reveals several different sets of philosophical concerns which do not conflict so much as they complement one another. These complimentary sets of concerns can be categorized into four groups:
Those familiar with Enlightenment-influenced presentations of Confucius as an austere humanist who did not discuss the supernatural may be surprised to encounter the term “theodicy” as a framework for understanding Confucius’ philosophical concerns. Confucius’ record of silence on the subject of the divine is attested by the Analects (5.3, 7.21, 11.12). In fact, as a child of the late Zhou world, Confucius inherited a great many religious sensibilities, including theistic ones. For the early Chinese (c. 16th century BCE), the world was controlled by an all-powerful deity, “The Lord on High” (Shangdi), to whom entreaties were made in the first known Chinese texts, inscriptions found on animal bones offered in divinatory sacrifice. As the Zhou polity emerged and triumphed over the previous Shang tribal rule, Zhou apologists began to regard their deity, Tian (“Sky” or “Heaven”) as synonymous with Shangdi, the deity of the deposed Shang kings, and explained the decline of Shang and the rise of Zhou as a consequence of a change in Tianming (“the mandate of Heaven”). Thus, theistic justifications for conquest and rulership were present very early in Chinese history.By the time of Confucius, the concept of Tian appears to have changed slightly. For one thing, the ritual complex of Zhou diviners, which served to ascertain the will of Tian for the benefit of the king, had collapsed with Zhou rule itself. At the same time, the network of religious obligations to manifold divinities, local spirits, and ancestors does not seem to have ceased with the fall of the Zhou, and Confucius appears to uphold sacrifices to “gods and ghosts” as consistent with “transmitting” noble tradition. Yet, in the Analects, a new aspect of Tian emerges. For the Confucius of the Analects, discerning the will of Tian and reconciling it with his own moral compass sometimes proves to be a troubling exercise:
If Heaven is about to abandon this culture, those who die afterwards will not get to share in it; if Heaven has not yet abandoned this culture, what can the men of Guang [Confucius' adversaries in this instance] do to me? (9.5)
There is no one who recognizes me…. I neither resent Heaven nor blame humanity. In learning about the lower I have understood the higher. The one who recognizes me – wouldn’t that be Heaven? (14.35)
Heaven has abandoned me! Heaven has abandoned me! (11.9)
As A. C. Graham has noted, Confucius seems to be of two minds about Tian. At times, he is convinced that he enjoys the personal protection and sanction of Tian, and thus defies his mortal opponents as he wages his campaign of moral instruction and reform. At other moments, however, he seems caught in the throes of existential despair, wondering if he has lost his divine backer at last. Tian seems to participate in functions of “fate” and “nature” as well as those of “deity.” What remains consistent throughout Confucius’ discourses on Tian is his threefold assumption about this extrahuman, absolute power in the universe: (1) its alignment with moral goodness, (2) its dependence on human agents to actualize its will, and (3) the variable, unpredictable nature of its associations with mortal actors. Thus, to the extent that the Confucius of the Analects is concerned with justifying the ways of Tian to humanity, he tends to do so without questioning these three assumptions about the nature of Tian, which are rooted deeply in the Chinese past.
The dependence of Tian upon human agents to put its will into practice helps account for Confucius’ insistence on moral, political, social, and even religious activism. In one passage (17.19), Confucius seems to believe that, just as Tian does not speak but yet accomplishes its will for the cosmos, so too can he remain “silent” (in the sense of being out of office, perhaps) and yet effective in promoting his principles, possibly through the many disciples he trained for government service. At any rate, much of Confucius’ teaching is directed toward the maintenance of three interlocking kinds of order: (1) aesthetic, (2) moral, and (3) social. The instrument for effecting and emulating all three is li (ritual propriety).
Do not look at, do not listen to, do not speak of, do not do whatever is contrary to ritual propriety. (12.1)
In this passage, Confucius underscores the crucial importance of rigorous attention to li as a kind of self-replicating blueprint for good manners and taste, morality, and social order. In his view, the appropriate use of a quotation from the Classic of Poetry (Shijing), the perfect execution of guest-host etiquette, and the correct performance of court ritual all serve a common end: they regulate and maintain order. The nature of this order is, as mentioned above, threefold. It is aesthetic — quoting the Shijing upholds the cultural hegemony of Zhou literature and the conventions of elite good taste. Moreover, it is moral — good manners demonstrate both concern for others and a sense of one’s place. Finally, it is social — rituals properly performed duplicate ideal hierarchies of power, whether between ruler and subject, parent and child, or husband and wife. For Confucius, the paramount example of harmonious social order seems to be xiao (filial piety), of which jing (reverence) is the key quality:
Observe what a person has in mind to do when his father is alive, and then observe what he does when his father is dead. If, for three years, he makes no changes to his father’s ways, he can be said to be a good son. (1.11)
[The disciple] Ziyu asked about filial piety. The Master said, “Nowadays, for a person to be filial means no more than that he is able to provide his parents with food. Even dogs and horses are provided with food. If a person shows no reverence, where is the difference?” (2.7)
In serving your father and mother, you ought to dissuade them from doing wrong in the gentlest way. If you see your advice being ignored, you should not become disobedient but should remain reverent. You should not complain even if you are distressed. (4.18)
The character of this threefold order is deeper than mere conventions such as taste and decorum, as the above quotations demonstrate. Labeling it “aesthetic” might appear to demean or trivialize it, but to draw this conclusion is to fail to reflect on the peculiar way in which many Western thinkers tend to devalue the aesthetic. As David Hall and Roger Ames have argued, this “aesthetic” Confucian order is understood to be both intrinsically moral and profoundly harmonious, whether for a shi household, the court of a Warring States king, or the cosmos at large. When persons and things are in their proper places – and here tradition is the measure of propriety – relations are smooth, operations are effortless, and the good is sought and done voluntarily. In the hierarchical political and social conception of Confucius (and all of his Chinese contemporaries), what is below takes its cues from what is above. A moral ruler will diffuse morality to those under his sway; a moral parent will raise a moral child:
Let the ruler be a ruler, the subject a subject, a father a father, and a son a son. (12.11)
Direct the people with moral force and regulate them with ritual, and they will possess shame, and moreover, they will be righteous. (2.3)
The last quotation from the Analects introduces a term perhaps most famously associated with a very different early Chinese text, the Laozi (Lao-tzu) or Daodejing (Tao Te Ching) – de (te), “moral force.” Like Tian, de is heavily freighted with a long train of cultural and religious baggage, extending far back into the mists of early Chinese history. During the early Zhou period, de seems to have been a kind of amoral, almost magical power attributed to various persons – seductive women, charismatic leaders, etc. For Confucius, de seems to be just as magically efficacious, but stringently moral. It is both a quality, and a virtue of, the successful ruler:
One who rules by moral force may be compared to the North Star – it occupies its place and all the stars pay homage to it. (2.1)
De is a quality of the successful ruler, because he rules at the pleasure of Tian, which for Confucius is resolutely allied with morality, and to which he attributes his own inner de (7.23). De is the virtue of the successful ruler, without which he could not rule at all.
Confucius’ vision of order unites aesthetic concerns for harmony and symmetry (li) with moral force (de) in pursuit of social goals: a well-ordered family, a well-ordered state, and a well-ordered world. Such an aesthetic, moral, and social program begins at home, with the cultivation of the individual.
In the Analects, two types of persons are opposed to one another – not in terms of basic potential (for, in 17.2, Confucius says all human beings are alike at birth), but in terms of developed potential. These are the junzi (literally, “lord’s son” or “gentleman”; Tu Wei-ming has originated the useful translation “profound person,” which will be used here) and the xiaoren (“small person”):
The profound person understands what is moral. The small person understands what is profitable. (4.16)
The junzi is the person who always manifests the quality of ren (jen) in his person and the displays the quality of yi (i) in his actions (4.5). The character for ren is composed of two graphic elements, one representing a human being and the other representing the number two. Based on this, one often hears that ren means “how two people should treat one another.” While such folk etymologies are common in discussions of Chinese characters, they often are as misleading as they are entertaining. In the case of ren – usually translated as “benevolence” or “humaneness” – the graphic elements of a human being and the number two really are instructive, so much so that Peter Boodberg suggested an evocative translation of ren as “co-humanity.” The way in which the junzi relates to his fellow human beings, however, highlights Confucius’ fundamentally hierarchical model of relations:
The moral force of the profound person is like the wind; the moral force of the small person is like the grass. Let the wind blow over the grass and it is sure to bend. (12.19)
D. C. Lau has pointed out that ren is an attribute of agents, while yi (literally, “what is fitting” — “rightness,” “righteousness”) is an attribute of actions. This helps to make clear the conceptual links between li, de, and the junzi. The junzi qua junzi exerts de, moral force, according to what is yi, fitting (that is, what is aesthetically, morally, and socially proper), and thus manifests ren, or the virtue of co-humanity in an interdependent, hierarchical universe over which Tian presides.
Two passages from the Analects go a long way in indicating the path toward self-cultivation that Confucius taught would-be junzi in fifth century BCE China:
From the age of fifteen on, I have been intent upon learning; from thirty on, I have established myself; from forty on, I have not been confused; from fifty on, I have known the mandate of Heaven; from sixty on, my ear has been attuned; from seventy on, I have followed my heart’s desire without transgressing what is right. (2.4)
The Master’s Way is nothing but other-regard and self-reflection. (4.15)
The first passage illustrates the gradual and long-term scale of the process of self-cultivation. It begins during one’s teenaged years, and extends well into old age; it proceeds incrementally from intention (zhi) to learning (xue), from knowing the mandate of Heaven (Tianming) to doing both what is desired (yu) and what is right (yi). In his disciple Zengzi (Tseng-tzu)’s summary of his “Way” (Dao), Confucius teaches only “other-regard” (zhong) and “self-reflection” (shu). These terms merit their own discussion.
The conventional meaning of “other-regard” (zhong) in classical Chinese is “loyalty,” especially loyalty to a ruler on the part of a minister. In the Analects, Confucius extends the meaning of the term to include exercising oneself to the fullest in all relationships, including relationships with those below oneself as well as with one’s betters. “Self-reflection” (shu) is explained by Confucius as a negatively-phrased version of the “Golden Rule”: “What you do not desire for yourself, do not do to others.” (15.24) When one reflects upon oneself, one realizes the necessity of concern for others. The self as conceptualized by Confucius is a deeply relational self that responds to inner reflection with outer virtue.
Similarly, the self that Confucius wishes to cultivate in his own person and in his disciples is one that looks within and compares itself with the aesthetic, moral, and social canons of tradition. Aware of its source in Tian, it seeks to maximize ren through apprenticeship to li so as to exercise de in a manner befitting a junzi. Because Confucius (and early Chinese thought in general) does not suffer from the Cartesian “mind-body problem” (as Herbert Fingarette has demonstrated), there is no dichotomy between inner and outer, self and whole, and thus the cumulative effect of Confucian self-cultivation is not merely personal, but collectively social and even cosmic.
While the Analects is valuable, albeit not infallible, as a source for the reconstruction of Confucius’ thought, it is far from being the only text to which Chinese readers have turned in their quest for discovering his identity. During the Han dynasty (206 BCE-220 CE), numerous hagiographical accounts of Confucius’ origins and deeds were produced, many of which would startle readers familiar only with the Analects. According to various texts, Confucius was a superhuman figure destined to rule as the “uncrowned king” of pre-imperial China. At birth, his body was said to have displayed special markings indicating his exemplary status. After his death, he was alleged to have revealed himself in a glorified state to his living disciples, who then received further esoteric teachings from their apotheosized master. Eventually, and perhaps inevitably, he was recognized as a deity and a cult organized itself around his worship. Feng Youlan has suggested that, had these Han images of Confucius prevailed, Confucius would have become a figure comparable to Jesus Christ in the history of China, and there would have been no arguments among scholars about whether or not Confucianism was a religion like Christianity.
To both ancient modern eyes, fantastic and improbable myths of Confucius should be added more recent myths about the sage that date from the earliest sustained contact between China and the West during the early modern period. The Latinization of Kong(fu)zi to “Confucius” originates with the interpretation of Chinese culture and thought by Jesuit missionaries for their Western audiences, supporters, and critics. Jesuits steeped in Renaissance humanism saw in Confucius a Renaissance humanist; German thinkers such as Leibniz or Wolff recognized in him an Enlightenment sage. Hegel condemned Confucius for exemplifying those whom he saw as “the people without history”; Mao castigated Confucius for imprisoning China in a cage of feudal archaism and oppression. Each remade Confucius in his own image for his own ends – a process that continues throughout the modern era, creating great heat and little light where the historical Confucius himself is concerned. Each mythologizer has seen Confucius as a symbol of whatever s/he loves or hates about China. As H. G. Creel once put it, once a figure like Confucius has become a cultural hero, stories about him tell us more about the values of the storytellers than about Confucius himself.
Such mythmaking was very important to the emerging imperial Chinese state, however, as it struggled to impose cultural unity on a vast and fractious territory during the final few centuries BCE and beyond into the Common Era. After the initial persecution of Confucians during the short-lived Qin dynasty (221-202 BCE), the succeeding Han emperors and their ministers seized upon Confucius as a vehicle for the legitimation of their rule and the social control of their subjects. The “Five Classics” – five ancient texts associated with Confucius – were established as the basis for the imperial civil service examinations in 136 BCE, making memorization of these texts and their orthodox Confucian interpretations mandatory for all who wished to obtain official positions in the Han government. The state’s love affair with Confucius carried on through the end of the Han in 220 CE, after which Confucius fell out of official favor as a series of warring factions struggled for control of China during the “Period of Disunity” (220-589 CE) and foreign and indigenous religious traditions such as Buddhism and Daoism rivaled Confucianism for the attentions of the elite.
After the restoration of unified imperial government with the Tang dynasty (618-907 CE), however, the future of Confucius as a symbol of the Chinese cultural and political establishment became increasingly secure. State-sponsored sacrifices to him formed part of the official religious complex of temple rituals, from the national to the local level, and orthodox hagiography and history cemented his reputation as cultural hero among the masses. The Song dynasty (969-1279 CE) Confucian scholar Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi, 1130-1200 CE) institutionalized the study of the Analects as one of “Four Books” required for the redesigned imperial civil service examinations, and aspiring officials continued to memorize the text and orthodox commentaries on it until the early twentieth century.
With the fall of the last Chinese imperial government in 1911, Confucius also fell from his position of state-imposed grandeur – but not for long. Within a short time of the abdication of the last emperor, monarchists were plotting to restore a Confucian ruler to the throne. Although these plans did not materialize, the Nationalist regime in mainland China and later in Taiwan has promoted Confucius and Confucianism in a variety of ways in order to distinguish itself from the iconoclastic Communists who followed Mao to victory and control over most of China in 1949. Even the Communist regime in China has bowed reverentially to Confucius on occasion, although not without vilifying him first, especially during the anti-traditional “Cultural Revolution” campaigns of the late 1960s and early 1970s.
Today, the Communist government of China spends a great deal of money on the reconstruction and restoration of old imperial temples to Confucius across the country, and has even erected many new statues of Confucius in areas likely to be frequented by tourists from overseas. Predictably, Confucius, as a philosopher, has been rehabilitated by culturally Chinese regimes across Asia, from Singapore to Beijing, as what Wm. Th. de Bary has called “the East Asian challenge for human rights” has prompted attempts to ground “human rights with Chinese characteristics” in an authentically traditional source. In short, Confucius seems far from dead, although one wonders if the authentic spirit of his fifth century BCE thought ever will live again.
Detailed discussion of Confucius’ key interpreters is best reserved for an article on Confucian philosophy. Nonetheless, an outline of the most important commentators and their philosophical trajectories is worth including here.
The two best known early interpreters of Confucius’ thought – besides the compilers of the Analects themselves, who worked gradually from the time of Confucius’ death until sometime during the former Han dynasty – are the Warring States philosophers “Mencius” or Mengzi (Meng-tzu, 372-289 BCE) and Xunzi (Hsun-tzu, 310-220 BCE). Neither knew Confucius personally, nor did they know one another, except retrospectively, as in the case of Xunzi commenting on Mencius. The two usually are cast as being opposed to one another because of their disagreement over human nature – a subject on which Confucius was notably silent (Analects 5.13).
Mencius illustrates a pattern typical of Confucius’ interpreters in that he claims to be doing nothing more than “transmitting” Confucius’ thought while introducing new ideas of his own. For Mencius, renxing (human nature) is congenitally disposed toward ren, but requires cultivation through li as well as yogic disciplines related to one’s qi (vital energy), and may be stunted (although never destroyed) through neglect or negative environmental influence. Confucius does not use the term renxing in the Analects, nor does he describe qi in Mencius’ sense, and nowhere does he provide an account of the basic goodness of human beings. Nonetheless, it is Mencius’ interpretation of Confucius’ thought – especially after the ascendancy of Zhu Xi’s brand of Confucianism in the twelfth century CE – that became regarded as orthodox by most Chinese thinkers.
Like Mencius, Xunzi claims to interpret Confucius’ thought authentically, but leavens it with his own contributions. Whereas Mencius claims that human beings are originally good but argues for the necessity of self-cultivation, Xunzi claims that human beings are originally bad but argues that they can be reformed, even perfected, through self-cultivation. Also like Mencius, Xunzi sees li as the key to the cultivation of renxing. Although Xunzi condemns Mencius’ arguments in no uncertain terms, when one has risen above the smoke and din of the fray, one may see that the two thinkers share many assumptions, including one that links each to Confucius: the assumption that human beings can be transformed by participation in traditional aesthetic, moral, and social disciplines.
Later interpreters of Confucius’ thought between the Tang and Ming dynasties are often grouped together under the label of “Neo-Confucianism.” This term has no cognate in classical Chinese, but is useful insofar as it unites several thinkers from disparate eras who share common themes and concerns. Thinkers such as Zhang Zai (Chang Tsai, 1020-1077 CE), Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi, 1130-1200 CE), and Wang Yangming (1472-1529 CE), while distinct from one another, agree on the primacy of Confucius as the fountainhead of the Confucian tradition, share Mencius’ understanding of human beings as innately good, and revere the “Five Classics” and “Four Books” associated with Confucius as authoritative sources for standards of ritual, moral, and social propriety. These thinkers also display a bent toward the cosmological and metaphysical which isolates them from the Confucius of the Analects, and betrays the influence of Buddhism and Daoism – two movements with little or no popular following in Confucius’ China — on their thought.
This cursory review of some seminal interpreters of Confucius’ thought illustrates a principle that ought to be followed by all who seek to understanding Confucius’ philosophical views: suspicion of the sources. All sources for reconstructing Confucius’ views, from the Analects on down, postdate the master and come from a hand other than his own, and thus all should be used with caution and with an eye toward possible influences from outside of fifth century BCE China.
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 14, 2005 | Originally published: