Higher-Order Theories of Consciousness
Defenders of higher-order theories of consciousness hold that consciousness is explained by the relation between two levels of mental states in which a higher-order mental state takes another mental state, such as a thought or sensation, as its object. By virtue of the higher-order state, the lower-order state is conscious. For example, I now have a visual sensation of the white and black computer screen. This sensation is conscious, according to higher-order theories, because I have a higher-order state about that sensation.Two distinctions are central to isolating the sort of consciousness the theory aims to explain. First, we can make distinctions among creature consciousness, state consciousness, and introspective consciousness. Creature consciousness is a property possessed by creatures that are awake and sentient. Since wakefulness and sentience are fairly straightforward biological features, there seems to be no special problem to be solved regarding creature consciousness. State consciousness is a property of mental states that marks the difference between unconscious and conscious states. When a state is conscious, there is something it is like to be in that state. Introspective consciousness involves attending to one’s own mental states. According to higher-order theory, the mystery of consciousness lies in the nature of conscious states, and the mystery can be explained in terms of higher-order representation. My mental state is conscious – that is, there is something it is like to be in my mental state – when I have a higher-order representation about it.
An intuitive way to talk about consciousness is to say that a mental state is conscious when we are conscious of it. But this intuitive formulation utilizes two different uses of the word “conscious.” The first use is called intransitive, because this form of consciousness has no object. State consciousness is an intransitive form of consciousness. The second use is called transitive, because this form of consciousness takes an object; transitive consciousness is consciousness of something. Introspective consciousness is a transitive form of consciousness, because it takes mental states as objects. With this distinction in hand we can restate the higher-order explanation in this way: intransitive state consciousness is explained in terms of transitive consciousness of mental states.
Table of Contents
- Two Problem of Consciousness
- The Higher-order Solution
- Higher-order Thought Theory
- Higher-order Perception Theory
- On Terminology and Target
- Simple or Simplistic: An Assessment
- References and Further Reading
Conscious states are a central feature of our waking life. When we gaze at a spectacular array of fall leaves as they change color, smell onions frying or touch the soft skin of a newborn, we appreciate the feelings unique to each experience. There is something it is like to have these feelings, but what exactly? Though conscious states are ubiquitous in our everyday lives, we rarely reflect on their nature, and when we do, we find them frustratingly difficult to describe. We point to the contents of consciousness, what we are conscious of, and the qualities associated with those contents: the reds and yellows of leaves, the pungent odor of onions, the smoothness of skin. The distinctive character of each of these qualities marks one problem of consciousness: how to account for the differences between red and yellow, pungent and sweet, smooth and rough. A second problem, central to higher-order theory, is to explain what is in common to all conscious states, what it is like to have any kind of feelings at all. In other words, higher-order theories of consciousness propose to explain the nature of conscious states, as such.
In order to account for the nature of conscious states, the question a higher-order theorist must answer is: why is there something it is like to be in conscious states when there is nothing it is like to be in unconscious states, such as a coma state or a state of dreamless sleep? What is the difference between these two types of states? In particular, what makes a mental state a conscious mental state? As noted above, a higher-order account of consciousness proposes that a mental state is conscious when there is a higher-order state, either a thought or a perception, about it. Say I wake up feeling a terrible pain in my knee, but as I become involved in the day’s activities, I so completely forget about the pain that it ceases to hurt. With each lull in my busy schedule, though, the feeling of pain returns in full force. In light of the similarity in feeling and biological foundation, it is reasonable to say that the same sensation of pain remains throughout the day, although I am only occasionally conscious of the pain. The higher-order theory captures the intuitive plausibility of this explanation by describing consciousness of the pain in terms of a higher-order thought or perception about the otherwise unconscious pain state. When I forget about the pain, there is no higher-order state and so I remain unconscious of the pain. Later in the day, a higher-order state about the pain recurs, and in virtue of this higher-order state I am again conscious of the pain.
The higher-order state is about the lower-order state, which is to say that an intentional relation holds between the higher-order and lower-order states. Thoughts and perceptions are two familiar sorts of intentional states. Thoughts can be about things in the world, such as a tree or an onion. Thoughts can be about abstract items, such as numbers or average families. And thoughts can be about other thoughts, as when I think: I am thinking about consciousness too much; I should take a break.
Perceptions can also be about things in the world, such as when I see a tree or smell an onion. Notably, perceptions are much more detailed than thoughts, capturing a wide array of sensory variation. On the other hand, it is less clear how perceptions could be about abstract items or thoughts. One way to perceive abstract things could be by virtue of concrete representations, so you might be said to see the number 3 by means of the numeral that represents it. Similarly, a thought might be expressed in subvocal speech, as when I think to myself a sentence like: “I am thinking about consciousness too much; I should take a break.”
The differences between thoughts and perceptions yield reasons in favor of each form of higher-order account. They will be considered in turn, beginning with the higher-order thought theory. Several versions of higher-order thought theory have been proposed since David Rosenthal (1986) introduced the theory. Two versions to be considered below are the Wide-Intrinsicality View (WIV), developed by Rocco Gennaro (1996) and the dispositional higher-order thought theory, proposed by Peter Carruthers (2000).
Recall that the basic role of higher-order theories is to account for the nature of conscious states in terms of higher-order states about them. According to Rosenthal’s higher-order thought theory (1986, 1997, 2005), a mental state is conscious when there is a higher-order thought about it. I am conscious of the pain in my knee when I have a thought to the effect that I am in that very pain state.
A few refinements and elaborations of this basic formulation are necessary to avert various straightforward difficulties. First, Rosenthal notes that state consciousness must seem immediate. When I am conscious of my pain, I am not conscious of any inferential process preceding the consciousness. I do not think to myself, “Wow, I just hit my knee really hard, I must be feeling pain.” Similarly, if a doctor informed me that my knee surgery would likely involve lingering pain, this information alone would be insufficient to make my pain conscious. No conscious inferential or observational process intervenes between a mental state and the higher-order thought about it.
Second, consciousness is a relational property of mental states; it is not intrinsic to their nature. For example, if someone began calling you by a nickname, no intrinsic feature of you would change, but you would now be represented in a new way. Similarly, a mental state is conscious by virtue of standing in a representational relation to a higher-order thought. The mental state itself does not change when it is conscious; rather, it acquires a new relation. Some have found this feature of the higher-order account implausible, arguing that consciousness seems to mark a change in the intrinsic nature of conscious states. (Gennaro 1996) A commitment to consciousness as intrinsic prompted the introduction of a version of higher-order thought theory called the Wide Intrinsicality View (WIV) , which is discussed in the next section.
A third important feature of higher-order thoughts on Rosenthal’s account is that they are assertoric and occurrent. The higher-order thought must assert, rather than hope, fear or speculate that I am in a particular mental state. Moreover, the higher-order thought must occur at roughly the same time as the mental state it represents. The content of the higher-order thought should be, for example: “I am now feeling pain,” not “I might have felt pain yesterday” or “Perhaps I will feel pain in a few minutes.” Rosenthal (1997) has argued that higher-order thoughts must be occurrent in order to distinguish between non-conscious and conscious states. If the mere disposition to produce a higher-order thought were sufficient for a mental state to be conscious, it seems that all one’s mental states would always be conscious. But the example of intermittent knee pain suggests that we may be conscious of mental states at one time, and not conscious of them at another time. The recent development of a dispositional version of higher-order thought theory addresses this concern and will be considered below.
Fourth, higher-order thoughts are not introspective states. Since conscious states are a regular feature of our waking life, it may seem that higher-order thoughts should be equally apparent on this account. However, as Rosenthal (1986) points out, a higher-order thought is only conscious when there is a yet higher-order thought about it, and these conscious higher-order thoughts constitute introspective states. Since introspection is a fairly rare occurrence, it should not be surprising that we are rarely aware of our higher-order thoughts. It is interesting to note that higher-order thought theory differs from higher-order perception theory in this description of the relation between state consciousness and introspection. According to higher-order perception theory, all higher-order states are introspective states, although the active, deliberate form of introspection is fairly rare. (Armstrong 1968, 1999; Lycan 1996) Both theories agree that lower-order states are conscious by virtue of appropriate higher-order states, but they differ in their description of how the presence of higher-order states solves the problem of consciousness. While this difference could simply be a terminological issue, substantive consequences may follow (see On Terminology and Target ).
A final feature of the theory is the importance of self-reference within the content of the higher-order thought. Conscious states are mental states of one’s own. I can only be conscious of my knee pain, not yours. Rosenthal (1997) stresses that a minimal self-concept is sufficient to secure the reference necessary for higher-order thoughts; only the ability to distinguish between one’s self and something other than one’s self is required. Consequently, creatures with limited conceptual capacities may have conscious states. Where we would describe the content of a higher-order thoughts as, for example, ‘I am feeling pain,’ a more neutral formulation might be ‘this individual is feeling pain.’ Though Rosenthal minimizes the requirements for self-reference in higher-order thought content, the self, which is the subject of consciousness, figures centrally in the theory. Only a person or creature can be transitively conscious of things; mental states alone cannot bear the appropriate relation to other mental states. It may be in virtue of a mental state, namely, a higher-order thought, that one is conscious, but the higher-order thought itself cannot be transitively conscious of anything. (Rosenthal 1997) When I am conscious of my knee pain, I am conscious of the pain by virtue of a higher-order thought about the pain.
This qualification generates some confusion as to how exactly higher-order thoughts explain conscious states. (Droege 2003) First we find that consciousness is not an intrinsic feature of a mental state, it is a relational feature constituted by the presence of a higher-order thought about it. The higher-order thought explains the state consciousness. But not quite, for a higher-order thought – even of the right kind – is insufficient for state consciousness. There must be a creature who is transitively conscious of her mental states, in virtue of having a higher-order thought about them. The important role of the creature as the subject of consciousness suggests that creature consciousness bears more weight in the higher-order thought account than the definitions above admit.
Two other objections apply generally to higher-order thought accounts of consciousness. First, note that the content of the higher-order thought determines the content of consciousness. When functioning properly, the content of an occurrent mental state forms the content of the higher-order thought. It is possible, however, for higher-order thought content to be empty or to misrepresent a mental state. In such cases I might be conscious of a pain in my knee, while in fact the sensation is located in my hip, or is a phantom pain. (Neander 1998, Levine 2001) In response, Rosenthal has argued that these forms of reference failure are rare and detectable, and so do not constitute a problem for higher-order theory. (Rosenthal, 1986, 1991)
A second objection involves the possibility of animal and infant consciousness. Because thoughts require concepts, there is some question about whether simple creatures like bats are conceptually sophisticated enough to be considered conscious on this account. Carruthers (1989, 1999) has accepted the consequence that animals are not conscious on the higher-order account and has argued that our sympathy for animal suffering is motivated by the animal’s pain sensation and its behavioral effects rather than by the animal’s consciousness of pain. On the other hand, Rosenthal (1997) and Gennaro (1993, 2004b) claim that animal consciousness is not ruled out by the theory because higher-order thoughts need not be more sophisticated than conceptually rudimentary content such as “this feeling.”
As noted above, versions of higher-order thought theory differ on some key points. According to the version developed by Rocco Gennaro (1996), conscious states are complex states composed of a mental state and a higher-order thought about it. This theory is known as the Wide Intrinsicality View (WIV) because consciousness is intrinsic to these complex states. The primary motivation for this version of higher-order thought theory is the sense that consciousness inheres in conscious states themselves. The remarkable change that occurs when a mental state becomes conscious seems to involve a change in that very mental state rather than a change in relations external to it. From this perspective, the relation ‘represented by a higher-order thought’ seems no more able to account for the phenomenon of consciousness than the relation ‘to the left of.’ In response to this problem, the WIV takes the higher-order relation to be internal rather than external to the conscious state. Therefore, consciousness is intrinsic to the state constituted by a mental state and the higher-order thought about it.
Furthermore, a higher-order relation changes the nature of a mental state. Following Kant, Gennaro argues that concepts must be applied to sensory states in order to organize sensory information into a coherent array of objects. Higher-order thoughts provide the conceptual resources that determine the content of the conscious sensation. A self-referential component is also necessary to relate one’s experience of the world to one’s self. Yet it is important to note that the higher-order component of the conscious state is implicit. All I feel is the hurtfulness, but in order for the pain to feel the specific content of ‘hurtful,’ a higher-order concept needs to be applied to the sensation, and in order for the pain to feel hurtful to me, a self-referential component is needed as well. The higher-order thought fulfills these functions, thereby making the pain sensation conscious.
Rosenthal has objected that intrinsic theories, such as the WIV, fail to provide a reductive explanation of consciousness. If consciousness is an intrinsic property of conscious states, then they are simple and unanalyzable and so inexplicable. (Rosenthal 1986, 1991) In response, Gennaro (1996) denies that the intrinsic nature of consciousness is incompatible with its complexity. A conscious state can be explained in terms of the mental state and the higher-order thought that compose it, even though the property of consciousness is intrinsic to the whole complex state. However, as Rosenthal (1997) observes, the complexity of the conscious state makes it equally plausible to regard the property as extrinsic to the lower-order state and explainable by the presence of a distinct higher-order thought.
A third version of the theory suggests that higher-order thoughts function dispositionally: mental states are conscious when they are available to a system capable of producing higher-order thoughts, even if no actual higher-order thought occurs. In answer to Rosenthal’s worry that all mental states would be conscious on a dispositional theory, Peter Carruthers (2000) has argued that two perceptual systems exist. One system is primarily action guiding and utilizes unconscious perceptual states. An unconscious pain in my knee, for example, might lead me to favor one leg when walking, even if I did not realize that I was limping. The other perceptual system is designed to generate beliefs about perceptual information, so perceptual states in this system must carry information about the pain and about my experience of the pain.
On the functional/inferential role account of content advocated by Carruthers, the content of a mental state is partly determined by the information it carries. Since the function of the belief-forming perceptual system is to produce higher-order thoughts, the states in this system take on two kinds of content: the perceptual content ‘is painful’ and the higher-order content ‘seems painful.’ The pain acquires the subjective, experiential aspect of ‘seeming painful’ by virtue of my ability to think about the pain and to form beliefs about it. The pain may cause me to limp, and it also may cause me to think about how much my knee hurts and to plan what I might do to relieve the pain. In order to be able to think about my pain, it must seem some way to me; it must seem painful. Carruthers argues that perceptual states are conscious when they acquire the higher-order content that constitutes the experiential aspect of the perceptual state.
This version of higher-order thought theory is particularly interesting because it is also a form of higher-order perception theory. According to Carruthers, both forms of content involved in conscious states are fine-grained, non-conceptual content, in other words, perceptual content. I can perceive a red object without knowing that it is red and without being able to identify its particular shade of red. Likewise, an object may seem red to me without further categorization or description, provided I have the ability to make these sorts of judgments. On the dispositional higher-order thought account, perceptual states acquire higher-order content by virtue of their availability to a system capable of forming higher-order thoughts, and they possess this dual content whether or not a higher-order thought is formed. Consequently, no actual higher-order thought or higher-order perception (and so no inner sense mechanism) is required for consciousness.
Though there have been more advocates of the higher-order thought theory in recent years, the higher-order perception theory is arguably the first higher-order account of consciousness. Its roots trace to John Locke’s inner sense theory where he distinguishes two ways of acquiring knowledge: perception and reflection. Perception yields ideas of sensible qualities such as yellow, hot, and soft.
“The other Fountain [reflection], from which Experience furnisheth the Understanding with Ideas, is the Perception of the Operations of our own Minds within us, as it is employ’d about the Ideas it has got.” (Essay II, 1, §4, 104) Locke describes the way we perceive the operations of our minds as comparable to an ‘internal sense.’ A few sections later in the Essay, Locke then identifies consciousness with the process of reflection when he states: “Consciousness is the perception of what passes in a Man’s own mind.” (Essay II, 1, §19, 115)
Contemporary theorists David Armstrong (1968, 1981, 1999) and William Lycan (1987, 1996) follow Locke in arguing that consciousness should be explained in terms of the operation of an inner sense. Our mental states are conscious when internal scanners produce perceptual representations of them. The process of internal scanning, or higher-order monitoring, is to coordinate and relay information about mental states in order to better plan and monitor action. Inner scanners fulfill this function by producing higher-order perceptual representations.
Like higher-order thought theory, state consciousness is explained in terms of higher-order representations of mental states. On both forms of theory my knee pain is conscious when I acquire a higher-order representation about the pain. Unlike higher-order thought theory, the higher-order representation is similar to perceptual representation on the inner sense account. Conceptual discrimination is more limited than perceptual discrimination, so one point in favor of the higher-order perception account is its ability to accommodate the rich detail of conscious states. (Lycan 2004) Moreover, no special conceptual powers are required to produce higher-order perceptions, so there is no reason animals could not be conscious on this view.
One concern about the higher-order perception theory involves the nature of the ‘inner sense.’ Although an ‘inner sense’ or ‘internal scanners’ are central to the higher-order perception theory, the theory does not depend on the existence of a dedicated organ. Armstrong (1968) has compared inner sensing to proprioception in its wide distribution and function. Lycan (1996, 2004) has suggested that inner sensing is accomplished by means of attention mechanisms.
A more persistent problem with the higher-order perception theory is the claim that it is impossible to attend to one’s mental states. Most famously argued by G.E. Moore (1903), the transparency claim is that any attempt to attend to a sensation immediately results in attention to the object that the sensation represents. A related objection notes that unlike perceptual states, no special qualities are associated with conscious states. If there was an inner sense, we would expect inner sensory qualities on a par with visual, auditory and tactile qualities. (Rosenthal 1997) Finally, it is worth noting that, like higher-order thoughts, higher-order perceptions might be empty or misrepresent the states they are about. In such a case, you might feel a sensation of pain that in fact was a sensation of cold, or you might feel a pain in the absence of any sensation at all. (Neander 1998) As with Rosenthal, Lycan (1998) takes this to be a case of a higher-order representation as of pain in the absence of a pain sensation, and argues that the result would be a strange, pain-like feeling in the absence of the behavioral effects of pain.
One difficulty in comparing higher-order thought and higher-order perception theories involves determining the target for explanation. While both forms of theory are similarly structured, it is unclear that they take the same phenomenon for their explanandum. Notwithstanding disputes among the higher-order thought theorists listed above, the central claim of higher-order thought theory is clear – higher-order thoughts account for the difference between conscious states and unconscious states; state consciousness constitutes the great mystery of consciousness. The higher-order perception theory also explains the difference between conscious states and unconscious states, but Lycan (1996) argues that this difference is not the truly mysterious aspect of consciousness. Rather, the primary value in higher-order perception theory lies in its explanation of what it’s like for the subject to be in conscious states as opposed to unconscious states. Lycan identifies this explanadum as subjective consciousness. The difference may simply be a matter of emphasis, but it raises a general question about the explanandum of higher-order theory: whether the theory explains a difference in the nature of the mental states, as higher-order thought theory claims, or a difference in the nature of the subject of the mental states, as higher-order perception theory suggests.
The central virtue of higher-order theories of consciousness lies in their explanatory simplicity. Each of these theories accounts for the phenomena of consciousness exclusively in terms of familiar types of mental states: thoughts and perceptions. Higher-order mental states are also well-known from deliberate, self-conscious introspection. So, it seems reasonable to think that consciousness might be explained by a kind of higher-order process that is more automatic and lacks the attentive self-consciousness that accompanies more focused forms of reflection. Thus, higher-order theories avoid invoking mysterious processes or unknown structures to account for consciousness; there are no ‘ontological danglers.’ More complex states are explained in terms of less complex states and various relations, such as ‘aboutness.’ As a result, consciousness is seen to be of a piece with other mental phenomena, which are in turn accountable in natural, physical terms. Consciousness is special, and in its own way mysterious, but it is amenable to explanation.
As often happens, the primary disadvantage of higher-order theories follows from their primary advantage. The explanation seems too simple to account for the elusive difference between conscious and unconscious states, and so higher-order theory strikes many as implausible. The most often cited problem – known variously as the problem of absent qualia, the hard problem of consciousness (Chalmers 1996), and the explanatory gap (Levine 1983, 2001) – is that it seems higher-order states can perform their functions in the absence of any conscious feeling. Unless one is already an adherent of the higher-order view, there seems no reason to believe that the acquisition of higher-order states, however carefully described, should usher in the sights, sounds and feels of our conscious life. Rosenthal (1991) and Lycan (1998) argue that qualitative differences, such as the difference between red and green, can be accounted for by differences in first-order sensory states. When we acquire higher-order states we become aware of these differences among our sensory states. Nonetheless, one can ask how exactly those differences become conscious by the acquisition of a higher-order state. One answer is that higher-order representation is simply what consciousness is. The intuition Rosenthal often utilizes as a grounding premise in arguing for higher-order theory is that a conscious state is a mental state one is conscious of. (Rosenthal 1986, 1993b, 1997, 2002, 2004) Given this initial premise, higher-order theory follows quickly. (Lycan 2001)
Further support for higher-order thought explanation of consciousness can be found in the connection between the acquisition of concepts and finer sensory discrimination. Wine tasters, for example, are able to appreciate subtle differences in the smell and taste of wine as a result of their understanding of its various properties. Additionally, the feeling of pain experienced by dental patients can be eased when they realize their anxiety leads them to misinterpret the vibration of the drill. (Rosenthal 2002) In defense of the higher-order perception theory, Lycan (1996) claims that an explanatory gap is unsurprising. On his account, the way each of us represents our own mental states is unique, determined by the functional role that higher-order representations play within the overall representational system that constitutes our minds. We can only talk about, and so explain, features of our first-order sensory representations – such as the difference between a sensation of red and a sensation of green – because we share the referents, red and green colored objects, in common. When we move to higher-order representation, we leave the realm of language and are left with only private means of referring to our sensations as, well, like that.
By incorporating first-order and higher-order content into the same conscious state, Carruthers (2000) and Gennaro (1996) draw a closer connection between the higher-order account of state consciousness and the account of qualitative difference. As we saw above, Carruthers maintains that conscious states have both first-order content, such as red, and higher-order content, seems red. So for Carruthers, differences in higher-order content constitute the differences in our conscious experiences of red and green. Similarly, Gennaro (2004b) argues that the qualitative properties of mental states inhere in the complex conscious state rather than in first-order states. Without the presence of a higher-order thought, the first-order perception lacks the distinctive character involved in seeing red.
In any case, it is important to recognize that higher-order theory is put forward as an empirical hypothesis, rather than an analysis of the logical relations for the term ‘consciousness.’ The project is to explain the phenomena of consciousness in relation to other mental states, such as thought and perception, and so to develop a stronger theoretical framework for understanding the mind. We may be able to imagine consciousness in the absence of higher-order states, but this does not mean that we can explain consciousness in the absence of higher-order states. Or so higher-order theorists maintain. (Rosenthal 2002, Carruthers 2000)
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