Consequentialism is the view that morality is all about producing the right kinds of overall consequences. Here the phrase “overall consequences” of an action means everything the action brings about, including the action itself. For example, if you think that the whole point of morality is (a) to spread happiness and relieve suffering, or (b) to create as much freedom as possible in the world, or (c) to promote the survival of our species, then you accept consequentialism. Although those three views disagree about which kinds of consequences matter, they agree that consequences are all that matters. So, they agree that consequentialism is true. The utilitarianism of John Stuart Mill and Jeremy Bentham is a well known example of consequentialism. By contrast, the deontological theories of John Locke and Immanuel Kant are nonconsequentialist.
Consequentialism is controversial. Various nonconsequentialist views are that morality is all about doing one’s duty, respecting rights, obeying nature, obeying God, obeying one’s own heart, actualizing one’s own potential, being reasonable, respecting all people, or not interfering with others—no matter the consequences.
This article describes different versions of consequentialism. It also sketches several of the most popular reasons to believe consequentialism, along with objections to those reasons, and several of the most popular reasons to disbelieve it, along with objections to those reasons.
Table of Contents
- Basic Issues and Simple Versions
- Two Simple Arguments for Consequentialism
- Arguments Against Consequentialism
- Further Arguments for Consequentialism
- References and Further Reading
There is disagreement about how consequentialism can best be formulated as a precise theory, and so there are various versions of consequentialism. Almost all lack standard names, so the names used here are mostly invented here. Perhaps the most standard precise version of consequentialism is Plain Consequentialism.
Plain Consequentialism: Of all the things a person might do at any given moment, the morally right action is the one with the best overall consequences. (If there is no one best action because several actions are tied for best consequences, then of course any of those several actions would be right.)
Other versions of consequentialism may be generated by making small changes in this theory, as we shall see, so long as the new theory stays faithful to the broad idea that morality is all about producing the right kinds of overall consequences.
Consequentialism does not itself say what kinds of consequences are good. Hence people can agree on consequentialism while disagreeing about what kind of outcome is good or bad. If you happen to be in charge of setting speed limits, you might be thinking that a bad result is a death: the fewer deaths, the better. But the people who die in accidents were all going to die eventually anyway, so a fatal accident does not mean there are more deaths than there otherwise would have been. Perhaps, then, what counts as a good result is the amount of life that the action adds or subtracts in the world? That would explain why fatal accidents are bad, since an early death means less life. But if quantity of life were the only kind of good result, then a long happy life would be no better than a long unhappy life.
The most traditional view among Consequentialists is that the only kind of result that is good in itself is happiness. The picture is roughly as follows. Suppose you are on average just as happy as I am, but you live twice as long. Then you will have had twice as much happiness as I had. So the total happiness we had is three times the happiness I had. Or suppose you are on average twice as happy as I am, and we live equally long. Here too you end up having had twice as much happiness as I had, so the total happiness we had is three times the happiness I had. Or suppose you are unhappy instead: on average just as unhappy as I am happy and for the same amount of time. Unhappiness can be thought of as negative happiness, so that the total happiness we two have in this third case is zero. Now, to find the goodness of the consequences of an action, simply take the total amount of happiness in those consequences. The more happiness there is, the better. Note that if what matters is the total amount, then it does not matter whether the happiness belongs to you or your friend or a stranger—or even a dog, if dogs can have happiness. And it does not matter whether the happiness will happen today or next year. See Bentham (1789); Den Uyl & Machan (1983).
If we take the above view that the good is happiness, and plug it into Plain Consequentialism, we get the view that the right action is the one that causes the most happiness—more than would have been caused by any of the available alternative actions.
On this view, a problem with setting a very high speed limit is that it causes early deaths, which reduce the amount of life and thus reduce the amount of happiness there will be. But a problem with setting a very low speed limit is that driving very slowly takes up time. If people can get where they are going more quickly, they will probably use the time they saved to do things that will add happiness to their lives or the lives of others. Consequentialism suggests that to set a speed limit rightly, you must balance such considerations accurately.
As mentioned above, in consequentialism the “consequences” of an action are everything the action brings about, including the action itself. In consequentialism, the “consequences” of an action include (a) the action itself, and (b) everything the action causes. What then, do these two kinds of consequence have in common, that makes them both “consequences”? If there is an answer, perhaps it is something like this: both A itself and the things A causes are things that happen if you do A rather than the alternatives to A.
Another important point about “consequences” is that the actual “consequences” of an action, beyond the action itself, need not be actual outcomes. (Before explaining this point, we should note that consequentialism on most versions is a theory about the moral quality of actions. And it is commonly thought that the main kinds of actions that can be morally right or wrong are intentional actions—things we do deliberately, not things like hiccups or small twitches. Hence in the context of consequentialism, perhaps “actions” should normally be understood to mean “intentional actions.”) Suppose I will bake a cake if you win a coin toss, and you are now deciding whether to toss the coin or just walk away. Eventually you decide to toss the coin, you win, and I bake the cake. Was the cake a consequence of your action of tossing the coin? Arguably it was not. For you could have tossed the coin in many slightly different ways, and in many slightly different positions. Your intentional action was to toss the coin, not to toss the coin in the precise manner and position in which you ended up tossing it. But it was the precise manner and position that made you win. Therefore, your intentional action of tossing did not make you win. (But see Tännsjö (1988), 41ff.) Hence, arguably, the consequence of your intentional action was a 50% chance of a cake—not a cake, not half a cake, but a 50% chance of a cake. Perhaps most consequences of most actions we decide on are like that: not actual outcomes, but only probabilities of outcomes.
The usual Consequentialist view is that a 50% chance of a certain good outcome is half as good as that good outcome itself, and a 10% chance is one tenth as good.
Hence it would be misleading to say that consequentialism is the view that morality is all about results. When your boss says she cares only about “results,” that commonly means she does not care whether your gamble had a 1% or a 99% chance of succeeding. She cares only about whether it actually succeeded—even though, as explained above, the success, when it happens, is arguably not a “consequence” of your intentional action at all.
Plain Consequentialism is a theory about which actions are right. Its standard is high. It says that among all the very many things we could do at any given time, only one or a very few of them are right. The implication is that the rest of them are wrong. So if your action does vastly more good than what most other people would do in similar circumstances, but you could have chosen an action that would have done even a little more, Plain Consequentialism says that what you did was morally wrong. Plain Scalar Consequentialism is different.
Plain Scalar Consequentialism: Of any two things a person might do at any given moment, one is better than another to the extent that the its overall consequences are better than the other’s overall consequences.
That is, if A’s consequences are a little better than B’s, then A is morally a little better than B; and if A’s consequences are much better than C’s, then A is morally much better than C. This theory implies that the actions with the best consequences are morally best, but it does not say that if you do the second-best you are doing something morally wrong. It says nothing about right and wrong. See Singer (1977); Norcross (1997).
Of course, we cannot know the overall consequences of our actions. For example, the setting of a speed limit will help some people and hurt others, but there is no way to know in advance who the people will be, what projects will be helped or hindered, and how the further effects of all these things will play out over the centuries. You cannot know all that before you act (or after).
Is that point an objection to consequentialism? On the one hand, one might think it is an objection, since we are responsible for doing what is morally right and so we must be able to know what is morally right. On the other hand, one might think it is impossible to know what is morally right; morality seems permanently controversial and mysterious. It is unclear, then, whether the standard to which we should hold theories of morality is that they must explain why morality is easy to know about or why morality is terribly hard to know about!
The fact that we do not know the overall consequences of our actions makes room for further versions of consequentialism. Suppose I donate $100 to Malaria Aid, but it turns out this group aids malaria and I have funded an outbreak. Now, Plain Consequentialism implies that what I did is morally wrong, and Plain Scalar Consequentialism implies that it is morally very bad. But you might think that whether my action was morally wrong depends on what consequences it would have been reasonable for me to expect, not on the actual consequences. If the evil group was so cleverly deceptive that even the Better Business Bureau’s web site said they do good work fighting malaria, then you may think the damage done by my money was not my fault. So you may prefer a different version of consequentialism.
Expectable Consequentialism: The morally right action is the action whose reasonably expectable consequences are best. (There can also be a scalar version of this view and of the others introduced below.)
Reasonable estimates of consequences seem to involve a different kind of probability from that discussed in 1.b above. For example, suppose there is a machine that tosses a fair coin with such precision that whenever you press the Toss button, the coin always comes up heads. Now, suppose that you do not happen to know whether this machine always yields heads or always tails. (Or perhaps you do not even know that it is a precision machine.) When you press Toss, your action will have heads as a consequence, but you do not know that. So far as you can tell, heads and tails are equally likely, even if objectively there is a 100% chance of heads. This point can be expressed by saying that there is a 50% epistemic probability of heads, or that the reasonably expectable consequences of pushing the Toss button include a 50% epistemic chance of heads. For purposes of Expectable Consequentialism, a 50% epistemic chance of a good result is half as good as a 100% probability of that same result.
But Expectable Consequentialism has a strange implication. Suppose someone from Tuberculosis Aid comes to my door, says only, “Would you give to Tuberculosis Aid?” and hands me a pamphlet, which explains their evil plans on page 2. The reasonable way to estimate consequences would involve at least glancing through the pamphlet, but I am not interested. I simply assume that this group fights tuberculosis, and I do not look at the pamphlet because I do not care. I do not donate. Thus, without reasonably thinking about my choice, I have done what it would have been reasonable to estimate would have the best results. So Expectable Consequentialism says my thoughtless selfish action was morally right. If you do not want to praise my conduct, you might prefer a new version of consequentialism:
Reasonable Consequentialism: An action is morally right if and only if it has the best reasonably expected consequences.
Reasonable Consequentialism says that for an action of mine to be right, I must actually come to a reasonable conclusion beforehand about the consequences. Expectable Consequentialism says that an action can be right even if I do not think reasonably about it at all, so long as it is the action I would have estimated to have the best consequences if I had done a reasonable job of making an estimate. See Smart (1961).
Reasonable Consequentialism may be too simple. There was something right about my not donating. You might want to say that I fortunately did the right thing, but that my action was morally wrong. For another example, suppose I am sick and you are a doctor. You do a thorough and brilliant job of diagnosis and end up giving me the pill any responsible doctor would have to choose for the symptoms I display. But the pill turns out to harm me, because I have a rare and previously unknown virus. Now in one sense your prescription was wrong, but in another sense it was morally right. Dual Consequentialism can say both of those things. See Sidgwick (1907); Brink (1986).
Dual Consequentialism: The word “right” is ambiguous. It has a moral sense and an objective sense. (i) The objectively right action is the action with the best consequences, and (ii) the morally right action is any action with the best reasonably expected consequences.
If most people who live along a short river toss their garbage in the river, so that it is always full of garbage, then your tossing your own garbage in the river makes no difference to the river, and it saves the inconvenience of driving a few miles to the dump. So consequentialism would seem to support your tossing your garbage in the river. But if everyone hauled their garbage a few miles to the dump instead, in a year or two everyone would have a nice river, which is much more valuable to each person than the minor convenience of not having to haul one’s garbage to the dump. In this case, if each person follows consequentialism, the results are predictably worse than if everyone does something else instead. Thus consequentialism seems to defeat its own purpose.
Hence another kind of theory has been suggested, which might or might not be regarded as a version of consequentialism.
Rule Consequentialism: An action is morally right if and only if it does not violate the set of rules of behavior whose general acceptance in the community would have the best consequences—that is, at least as good as any rival set of rules or no rules at all.
(The name ‘Rule Consequentialism’ is an established term for many variant theories similar to the above). On this theory, an action is not right or wrong because of its own consequences; rather, it is right or wrong depending on whether it violates the collective rules that would have the best consequences. According to Rule Consequentialism, the right thing for each person in the community near the river to do is to follow the rule, “Throw garbage in the dump, not in the river.” Even if nobody else is going to the dump, and your going to the dump causes only inconvenience and no benefit, Rule Consequentialism says to take your garbage to the dump because that is what the best set of community rules would require.
Rule Consequentialism in one or another form has received a great deal of discussion. But since many people regard it as not quite in the spirit of consequentialism and many of the issues surrounding Rule Consequentialism are unique to it, we shall say little more about it here. See Brandt (1979); Hooker et al (2000).
There are more versions of consequentialism than are presented above. See Adams (1976); Railton (1988); Goodin (1995); Mulgan (1997); Murphy (1997). Some others are presented below, and anyone can invent new ones by following the instructions given in section 1a.
In Section 2 we shall look at two initial reasons to think consequentialism is true and some worries about those reasons. In Section 3 we shall discuss reasons to think consequentialism is false and some worries about those reasons. In Section 4 we shall return to more complex reasons to think consequentialism is true and some worries about those reasons.
Actions are transient things, soon gone forever. Hence, one might think, in the long run only the results remain, so the only thing that really matters about an action is its results. So consequentialism must be true.
But this reason for favoring consequentialism seems confused. For one thing, consequentialism holds that actions do matter, because they are among their own consequences. More importantly, in the long run no result remains, or at least no earthly result. Pleasures pass by as quickly as actions. People too pass away, and planets evaporate. If only permanent things mattered, then your happiness and misery in this life would not matter at all; but surely they do matter.
Arguably consequentialism is implicit in the very familiar conception of morality, shared by many cultures and traditions, which holds that moral perfection means loving all people, loving others as we love ourselves. For what is meant by “love” here? Forming many romantic attachments hardly seems like the path toward perfection; nor perhaps does the widespread spiritual exercise of focusing on wishing people well without actually helping them. If there is truth in the saying that we should “love all people,” perhaps it is simply that we should actively do what is good for people and not bad for them, as much as possible. If we try to produce the greatest total benefit, then we are loving “all people” in the sense that we are being impartial, caring for people in general, promoting each person’s well-being insofar as that is at stake in our actions and insofar as our helping one does not hurt others more.
A similar line of thought starts from the idea that morality is at bottom two things. First, abstractly, to be moral is to do one’s rational best to do what is objectively right. Second, more concretely, to be moral is to care about people. Now, rationality and objectivity are impartial; they do not favor one person over another. Hence to be moral is to care about people equally or impartially, so far as one can, which means trying to benefit people as much as one can. So consequentialism is correct.
One worry about these arguments is that if it happens that the most efficient way for you to help people is to send as much money as possible to help desperately poor people you do not know, then your following consequentialism may involve thinking of the people you know mainly as potential sources of money. And if someone thinks of the people she knows that way, it seems a stretch to call her a “loving” or even a “caring” person.
We turn now to some of the most popular reasons to think consequentialism is false and some possible replies to these attacks
It is in the spirit of consequentialism to look at goodness ultimately from an impartial, impersonal point of view. For example, a Consequentialist who thinks the kind of consequence that matters is happiness is unlikely to think that one person’s happiness is more important than another’s (so long as the amounts of happiness in question are the same). Hence consequentialism tends to hold that in deciding what to do, you ought to give just as much weight to the needs of total strangers as to the needs of your friends, your family, and even yourself. And since your dollar can usually do more good for desperate refugees than for yourself or your friends, consequentialism seems to hold that you ought to spend most of your dollars on strangers. But when you are deciding whom to spend your money on, common sense seems to hold that you are normally morally permitted to favor yourself over strangers and often morally required to favor your children over strangers. Hence consequentialism conflicts with common sense.
One reply to this objection is that since you know better how to help yourself and those near to you, you will get better results if you focus on them rather than people strange to you or out of view. Further, it is more natural for you to want to help those closer to you, so if you start projects to help your own rather than strangers, you are more likely to follow through and less likely to burn out or lose track of your purpose. Hence the consequences will probably be better. Further, those near to you are counting on your help, so that if you stop helping them their plans will be disrupted, while strangers will not be hurt in that way if you do not spend money on them. Further, your ability to think well and act effectively depends in many ways on your having strong relationships with a few people near to you, so that your spending a bit of time or money on these people not only gives them directly a bit of help or happiness, it also indirectly supports all your other projects now and in the future. For all these reasons it would seem that even a consequentialism that impartially counts each person’s happiness or well-being as being of equal value would advise each of us to be somewhat partial to herself and those near to her, because in that way she can produce the best impartial results. And perhaps that is why common sense favors some partiality. See Singer (1972); Jackson (1991); Kidder (2003).
A different kind of reply to the objection is to adjust consequentialism itself so that it is no longer impartial. Here are two simple examples of such theories:
Egoistic Consequentialism: Of all the things a person might do at any given moment, the morally right action is the one that has the best consequences for that person.
Friendly Consequentialism: Of all the things a person might do at any given moment, the morally right action is the one that has the best consequences for that person and her friends.
Theories like these that count the same kinds of consequence differently for each person acting, are sometimes called “agent-relative” forms of consequentialism, though one might wonder whether they are in the spirit of consequentialism at all. See Sen (1982), Nagel (1986), Scheffler (1994), Bennett (1989), Scheffler (1989), Brink (1986), and Skorupski (1995).
For consequentialism, the simplest way to conceive of the goodness of consequences is in terms of how much they contain of something that is considered good, such as happiness or personal well-being, regardless of who gets it. What matters is the total amount, not who gets what. Such a conception is egalitarian in the sense that it counts every bit of your happiness as being just as important as the same sized bits of my happiness. But one could object that in another sense, such a conception is not egalitarian because it does not care whether happiness is distributed equally or unequally among people. If the greatest total can be created only by exploiting the miserable to make the happy even happier, then such consequentialism would seem to say that you should do it. But common sense may rebel against that idea as being unfair or unjust. Hence consequentialism is wrong. See Le Guin (1973); Rawls (1999); Harsanyi (1977).
One reply to this objection is that our intuitive sense of fairness is not mainly concerned with distributions of ultimate goods like happiness or well-being. Rather, fairness is traditionally concerned with distributions of what we might call “external goods” – goods such as money, status, power, and political rights. These are good because of the further goods that they tend to produce. Now, serious inequality in external goods tends to reduce the total happiness. One reason is that, in general, external goods tend to produce more happiness or well-being when they go to people who have less of these goods than when they go to people who have more. For example, an extra dollar does more good for a poor person than for a rich person. That is a reason to think that promoting equality in external goods will tend to do more total good than promoting inequality. Another reason is that when there is more equality in the main external goods, the basic conditions of people’s lives will be more similar and people will find it easier to understand and sympathize with each other. Hence actions and policies that promote equality in external goods will cause more happiness by promoting a sense of community. Further, institutions that secure basic external equalities, or that aim to protect whoever is poorest and weakest, tend to give everyone more security. This makes life nicer and helps people be concerned for each other rather than fearful of each other, and they will therefore do more good for each other. Actions that promote egalitarian institutions, then, would tend to do the most good overall. Perhaps these points are the basis of our sense of the importance of equality.
A different kind of reply to the objection is to propose that one of the ultimate standards for goodness of consequences should be equality. One might propose, for example, that the consequences of an action are good insofar as they promote the total happiness and promote equality of happiness or of other goods. See Sidgwick (1907). However, once one introduces such a complex standard of goodness for consequences, questions arise as to how to rate the relative importance of the parts of the standard and about how such a view can be given theoretical elegance.
Consequentialism may ask us to meddle too much into other people’s business. For example, perhaps we can do the most good overall if we forcibly stop people from wasting their time and energy on pointless or harmful things like driving SUVs, watching television, eating meat, following sports, and so on. See Frey (1984).
For a more extreme example of meddling, suppose that by using your grandmother’s pension to contribute to efficient and thoughtful charities you can develop permanent clean water supplies for many distant villages, thus saving hundreds of people from painful early deaths and permitting economic development to begin. You need only keep her bound and gagged in the cellar and force her to sign the checks. Consequentialism would seem to say that you should do this, but moral common sense says that you should not. Hence consequentialism is opposed to common sense and is probably wrong.
For another example, suppose you are a surgeon with five patients, each about to die for lack of a certain medicine that you can obtain (in sufficient quantity) only by killing and grinding up a sixth patient. Should you do it? Consequentialism says you should do this; but moral common sense says that you should not. Hence consequentialism is opposed to common sense and so is probably wrong. Foot (1967).
Now, one reply to the extreme examples is that such opportunities are extremely unusual. (At least that is true of the surgery example.) Moral common sense is shaped by and for the demands of ordinary moral life and so common sense may not be very reliable in odd cases. Hence the fact that consequentialism disagrees with common sense about odd cases is no disproof of consequentialism.
Another reply to the extreme examples is to point out that although they rely on secrecy, they overlook secrecy’s consequential drawbacks. To keep a big secret, you must actively mislead and deceive people and keep them at a distance. Continued deception about a serious matter is difficult, so at the outset you must take into account the chance that you will fail or give up. See Jackson (1991). Continued difficult deception uses up mental resources. Hence if you have such a secret, your further projects will be more poorly chosen, designed, and carried out. Also, if you have important secrets, you may find it hard to have ordinary trust for others; you may become somewhat paranoid and ineffective. Further, if you have a big secret that would repel nice honest people, any nice honest person who learns your secret will not want to be your friend. Anyone who does not know your secret will not really know you and hence cannot be your real friend. But we need nice honest friends if we are to be effective doers of good in the long run. We need them for practical help, for mental health, and to help us see ourselves clearly. We need to see ourselves clearly in order to do good effectively in the long run. Now, if you are the sort of person who actually would send money to save distant strangers, anything that cripples your efforts will hurt many people. Hence the reasonable expectation is that embezzling your grandmother’s checks would have terrible consequences. And if you are a skilled surgeon, anything that hampers your operations will hurt people. Hence the reasonable expectation is that harvesting the healthy patient would have bad consequences. A similar argument might be made regarding almost any scheme that would horrify nice honest people.
A more general reply to the claim that consequentialism advises us to meddle in other people’s business is that even where secrecy would not be involved, there are Consequentialist reasons for you to avoid direct meddling with others’ private spheres and personal affairs. For one thing, each of us is in a better position to understand her own affairs than you are and more naturally and reliably concerned than you are to make sure that her own affairs are carried out well. If you get involved in meddling, can you trust yourself to meddle in the right direction and with adequate care? If you want to do good for me, doing the sorts of things that are normally thought of as violating my personal rights is probably a bad bet. That does not mean consequentialism tells you to leave me entirely alone. Consequentialism can still tell you to give me resources or opportunities, or to help me with my projects, or to help improve the laws of our community.
Further, it is important that people be free to make decisions for themselves, even poor decisions, because that is the only way that people develop strength of character and because constant experimentation is the only way humanity learns about the various possibilities of life. Hence consequentialism would seem to ask us to support laws that protect personal freedom against excessive interference by our neighbors or our government. See Mill (1859).
A different kind of reply to the objection is to propose a new standard for the goodness of consequences. One might propose, for example, that an action is good insofar as it decreases the amount of meddling in the world. Or one might propose instead that an action is good insofar as it causes less meddling and more total happiness. Of course, once one introduces such a complex standard of goodness for consequences, questions arise about how to rate the relative importance of the parts of the standard and about how such a view can be given theoretical elegance. A further worry about this new proposal is that it still does not directly tell us not to meddle. For if we can minimize the total amount of meddling in the long run by meddling today (perhaps by spying on terrorism suspects or by privately bombing the citizens of aggressive countries), this new theory tells us to do so. See Sen (1982).
Consequentialism seems to tell us to make all our decisions by thinking about overall consequences. But that way of thinking about life is, one might think, inhuman and immoral. When someone asks you a question, you should not stop to calculate the consequences before deciding whether to answer truthfully. If you decide by looking to the consequences, you are not really an honest person. Also, when you are about to follow through on a project you have started, you should not stop to calculate the overall consequences anew before you proceed. A sane person will decide on a project and then simply follow through, unless some new situation arises. Anyone who stops to calculate consequences before taking any step to fulfill a commitment is not a person of integrity. And what moves you to spend an hour with your friend or spouse or child should not be impartial calculations about the overall impact on the world at large. If you decide by looking to the overall consequences, you do not really love that person. Therefore consequentialism is an inhuman and immoral theory and must be wrong. See Williams (1973); Williams (1981); Stocker (1976).
Now, this objection does not directly apply to Plain Consequentialism or Plain Scalar Consequentialism, for these theories do not say that we should think about consequences. On the contrary, if you think in the inhuman way described in the objection, your plans and your relationships are unlikely to go well, so Plain versions of consequentialism tend to oppose that way of thinking. Such thinking would be action that has bad consequences. See Bales (1971), Railton (1994).
Nor does the objection apply to Rule Consequentialism. Rule Consequentialism suggests that we should evaluate rules of behavior by asking what the consequences would be if everyone accepted this or that rule, but does not say that the rightness of actions has anything to do with the consequences of those actions themselves. See Rawls (1955).
The objection does, however, directly attack Reasonable Consequentialism and Dual Consequentialism, because these theories say that an action is morally wrong unless we have a reasonable estimate of its consequences.
The defender of Reasonable or Dual Consequentialism might argue that the objection has misunderstood what it is to have a reasonable estimate of an action’s consequences. Perhaps it does not involve explicitly thinking about the consequences at all. As I proceed to feed my cat, I almost never think about the consequences of doing so versus not doing so, but surely it would be wrong to say that I have no view or that my view is not reasonable.
Another way of replying to the objection is to propose yet another version of consequentialism.
Double Consequentialism: The word “right” is ambiguous. It has a moral sense and an objective sense. (i) The objectively right action is the action with the best consequences, and (ii) the morally right action is any action one reasonably estimates to be objectively right.
This Double Consequentialism differs from the Dual Consequentialism of 1.e above only in point (ii), on the morally right action. Where Dual Consequentialism had said that the morally right action is “any action with the best reasonably expected consequences,” Double Consequentialism says the morally right action is the action one reasonably estimates to be objectively right. To see the difference in principle between these theories, suppose there is a somewhat reliable authority on what specific kinds of actions are objectively right. For example, suppose God, who knows all the consequences, has announced that certain kinds of things are right. Or suppose a society’s conventional views about what is right and wrong reflect centuries of experience about what tends to cause trouble. Or suppose the recommendation that comes from you friend, your mother, your heart, or your prior resolution, reflects insight into the implications of your action that would not be reflected in the conscious estimates of consequences you might be able to work up on the spur of the moment. Further, suppose that God, society, your friend or your heart has sufficient authority on the points it addresses that the most reasonable way for you to estimate which of your own options are objectively right is to trust that authority. If there is such an authority, then actions one chooses by deferring to the authority may be morally right according to Double Consequentialism even if they are morally wrong according to Dual Consequentialism.
For example, suppose Paul is considering stealing money from his grandmother to help the poor. So far as he can reasonably guess, that scheme would have the best overall consequences. But he remembers that stealing is generally regarded as wrong. He may or may not find consequentialism plausible, but in any case he knows he does not have a solid theoretical understanding of rightness; so he reasonably decides to trust his community’s confident view and does not pursue the scheme. Double Consequentialism says his choice is morally right, even though his decision was not based on estimates of consequences and went against his estimates.
One might object that if the objectively right action is the one whose consequences are best, then general social opinion cannot be an authority on objective rightness, even on those issues where the general opinion is clear. For general social opinion does not agree that the objectively right action is the one whose consequences are best.
But this objection assumes that an authority on the question whether an action is objectively right would have to know exactly what objective rightness is. That assumption may be mistaken, because it is not true that an authority on whether something has a certain feature has to know exactly what that feature is. For example, suppose that many years ago, before anyone knew that gold is made of atoms or that it is the element with atomic number 79, Jack and Jill were hiking in unclaimed land and came upon some heavy shiny lumps. Jack had no idea how to identify gold. But Jill had handled gold a few times before and could make a good guess about whether the lumps were really gold. For the moment, Jill was an authority for Jack on whether these lumps were gold. It was reasonable for him to rely on her imperfect judgment, even though neither of them knew quite what gold is.
Since Double Consequentialism does not imply that you should estimate the consequences of your everyday actions, it seems to escape the objection that consequentialism requires inhuman and immoral thinking.
One argument for consequentialism begins from the premise that whatever a person does, she does in order to produce some sort of good result. It may be a benefit to herself or to someone else. It may be a short-run benefit or a long-run benefit. It may be a benefit of a particular kind: a financial benefit, a heath benefit, entertainment or knowledge. It may be the prevention of some harm. But whatever a person does, she does in order to produce some sort of benefit. Her expectation that it will produce or promote that good outcome is her reason for performing the action. Now, different kinds of benefits yield different kinds of reasons. For example, if a certain action would be good for the bank account but bad for the health, there is a financial reason for it and a health reason against it. Similarly, if a certain action would be good for me but bad for you, there is a reason for it and a reason against it. To find out whether the action is rationally justifiable overall, one must look beyond these specific kinds of reason to find what overall reason there is. That is, one must look to see whether financial benefit outweighs the health drawback, and whether the benefit to me outweighs the harm to you. In other words, one must ask whether the action promotes benefit overall. Therefore, an action is rationally justifiable insofar as it does good overall. And since we ought to do what is rationally justifiable, we ought to do whatever does the most good overall. Hence Consequentialism is true.
One worry about the above argument is that its initial premise may be false. We may sometimes act not to produce a benefit, but in order to obey a principle we accept. For example, you may do something simply because you have promised or because it is required by law, without looking to the consequences. Even if every action does aim at some benefit, this does not show that the benefit is the whole reason for each action. Perhaps our reason for each action is a combination of two things: the idea that the action will produce benefits and the idea that the action is morally permissible—that it would not violate any principles of morality. If every action is taken to produce some benefit, that shows only that the benefit is part of the reason for every action, not that the benefit is the whole reason.
Another worry about the above argument is that it presupposes that the notion of overall benefit makes sense. To see how someone might question that, think about skills and skill. Many of our actions are aimed at developing skill. But skill is not one thing. Many of our actions are aimed at developing a skil. To practice one skill, one must neglect or even undermine another skill. (Boxing makes me worse at the piano.) But that does not imply that there is a kind of skill that is neither boxing nor piano but simply “overall skill,” nor does it imply that my training actions are irrational unless I think they will promote overall skill. See Foot (1985); Scanlon (1998).
Consider the following argument for consequentialism adapted from Foot (1985).
- The whole of an action’s consequences has no further consequences. (Premise)
- When we are choosing among such wholes, nothing else is at stake. (From 1)
- It can never be right to choose something worse over something better, when nothing else is at stake. (Premise)
- It can never be right to choose a worse whole set of consequences over a better. (From 2 and 3)
- In choosing an action, one is choosing its whole set of consequences. (Premise)
- One ought always to choose an action whose overall consequences are at least as good as the overall consequences of any of the alternative actions; in other words, consequentialism is true. (From 4 and 5)
A worry about the argument is that premise (5) may not be true. In choosing an action, one is normally not choosing its whole set of consequences, because one cannot know what most of the consequences are. One is normally not even choosing the reasonably expectable consequences, because one has not formed any expectation about the action’s likely overall consequences.
A second worry is that premise (1) may not support statement (2). Even though a whole set of consequences has no further consequences, it might have further implications. For not all implications are consequences. For example, one important implication of the fact that my speedometer’s hand is below the ‘55’ is that I am going slower than 55. That is why the position of the hand matters to me. But of course I know that the position of the hand has no effect on my speed. For another example, one important implication of an action I take may be that I (already) am a certain kind of person. An action can show what kind of person I am even if it does not make me be that kind of person. See Campbell and Sowden (1985).
A third worry about the above argument begins from a view about the adjective ‘good’. What we are saying about a knife when we say that it is a “good” one is very different from what we are saying about a painting when we say that it is a “good” one; and similarly the import of ‘good’ seems to differ in the phrases ‘good mathematician’, ‘good liar’, ‘good father’, and ‘good batch of crack’. Thus it would seem that the standards of goodness vary with the kind of thing we are talking about. Now, some kinds of thing do not suggest any standards of goodness: consider ‘good pebble’. If I point to a pebble and say that it is a “good pebble,” you will not know what I mean. Hence ‘good’ seems not to have a meaning in that context. To say that a certain pebble is good is meaningless. Similarly, there are no general standards of goodness for whole sets of consequences in genera. The phrase ‘good whole set of consequences’ is no more communicative or meaningful than the phrase ‘good pebble’. If that is right, then consequentialism itself must be wrong because consequentialism is at root the idea that we ought to bring about good consequences. See Geach (1956); Foot (1985); Thomson (1993).
This controversial line of thought is not only an objection to the above argument for consequentialism, it is also an argument against consequentialism. For if ‘good consequences’ is meaningless, then it cannot be correct to define right action in terms of good consequences, as consequentialism normally does.
One possible reply to this argument against consequentialism is that even if ‘good overall consequences’ turns out to be meaningless, one might still think, for example, that the right action is the one that causes the most happiness. One could phrase consequentialism in general terms as, for example, the theory that “there is some feature of consequences of actions such that the right action is the one whose consequences have that feature to the greatest degree.”
The remaining arguments for consequentialism given here, like the argument from love, do not speak merely of “good consequences overall.” Rather they defend consequentialism by defending the importance of some particular kind of consequence, such as happiness, the satisfaction of desire, or the well-being of people.
Consider the following argument for consequentialism.
- What objectively ought to happen, what is objectively desirable, is whatever would be wished for by a spectator with full knowledge and no bias; that is, someone who knows everything and is equally sympathetic with everyone. (Premise)
- An impartially sympathetic being who knows everyone’s desires would share everyone’s desires in proportion to their strength. (Premise)
- An all-knowing impartial being would, overall, wish for the greatest possible balance of satisfaction of the desires of all people. (From 2)
- What objectively ought to happen is whatever would promote the greatest possible balance of satisfaction of the desires of all people. (From 1 and 3)
- The right action is the one that objectively ought to happen. (Premise)
- The right action is whatever would promote the greatest possible balance of satisfaction of the desires of all people. (From 4 and 5)
- Consequentialism is true. (From 6)
One worry about the above argument is that it is not clear why we should think Premise 1 is true. Why would the absence of bias mean being equally sympathetic with everyone? Perhaps an easier way to be free of bias is to have no sympathy for anyone.
Another worry is that 1 and 2 do not imply 3. For one thing, 1 and 2 do not tell us that the ideal spectator would have no concerns other than those she derives from sympathy, but 3 does make that assumption. For another thing, suppose this amazing being does lack all other concerns. Now, 2 tells us that she is full of desires that conflict with each other. 3 says that she has another desire—the desire that all her other desires be fulfilled as much as possible. Why would she have that additional desire? One might suppose that if a person has two conflicting desires, it is rational for her to replace them with a single compromise desire. But if the spectator replaces her conflicting desires, then according to 2 she no longer has the sympathy that makes her a reliable judge. See Firth (1952); Hare (1981), Seanor and Fotion (1988).
Consider this argument for Plain Scalar Consequentialism, which is based on one proposed in Mill (1861):
- Desiring something is the same thing as thinking that it will increase one’s happiness or decrease one’s unhappiness. (Premise)
- What each person ultimately desires is only her own happiness. (From 1)
- What will satisfy each person’s desire is her own happiness—and whatever promotes that. (From 2)
- “X is desirable” means “If X occurs, X will help satisfy desire.” (Premise)
- What is ultimately desirable for each person is her own happiness—and whatever promotes that. (From 3 and 4)
- “Good” and “desirable” are synonyms. (Premise)
- What is good for you is happiness for you —and whatever promotes that. (From 5 and 6)
- 8. What is good is happiness—and whatever promotes that. (From 7, crossing ‘for you’ out of both sides of the equation)
- An action is good insofar as its overall consequences contain happiness. (From 8)
- Plain Scalar Consequentialism is true. (From 9)
One worry about this argument is that 1 seems false. For example, people often procrastinate from laziness or fear, knowing that they are hurting themselves in the long run. And even people who do not believe in a life after death often give their lives for larger causes.
Another worry is that it is unclear exactly how 7 is supposed to imply 8. Even in mathematics, crossing the same thing out of both sides of a true equation does not always yield a new true equation. If you cross out “+2” from both sides of “10+2 = 3(2+2),” you change a truth to a falsehood.
A shorter cousin of the above argument, focusing on the fulfillment of desire rather than on happiness, avoids those worries.
- “X is desirable” means “X will help satisfy desire if, X occurs.” (Premise)
- The words “good” and “desirable” are synonyms. (Premise)
- An action is good insofar as it helps to satisfy desire. (From 1 and 2)
- An action is good insofar as its consequences include the satisfaction of desire. (From 3)
- Consequentialism is true. (From 4)
One worry about this shorter argument is that Premise 2 may be false. For example, it sounds a bit odd to say that when you call someone a good person, you are calling her a desirable person.
Another worry is that it is obscure whether there is anything sensible that might be meant by a greater or lesser amount of “satisfaction of desire.” Are all desires to count or only those that exist at the time of the action or the decision (even if they disappear before most of the consequences arrive)? Presumably the stronger desires are to count for more. But if I desire something slightly and then intensely, which counts? Should a desire count for more if it is held for a longer time? Should it count if it is based on a factual mistake or if it is malicious? See Griffin (1986); Scanlon (1993).
There are many moral questions on which common sense is divided or simply stumped. People disagree with each other about the morality of using human embryos for stem cell research, downloading copyrighted music, giving little to the poor, eating animals, having certain kinds of sex, and many other things. One of the main reasons to investigate moral theory is to learn how to approach these questions reasonably.
But on many issues there is a broad range of solid agreement about what is morally obvious, at least in societies that have long permitted open discussion by all. We firmly agree, for example, that equality and rights are very important, that it is not wrong to favor our family and friends over strangers, that it is wrong to torture children, and so on. When we are thinking about morality, that is usually because we are puzzled about some hard question. At such times we might overlook the fact that the aspects of morality that we agree on as obvious cover so much territory that they sketch the basic shape of civilized life.
Yet there is not broad agreement on the abstract question, “What is morality all about? What is morality?” Consequentialism is, as we have seen, one of many different proposed answers to that question. The true answer would presumably have some sort of simplicity and would presumably support most of the concrete moral views that seem most obvious to our common sense. So if consequentialism agrees with common sense, that agreement is some reason to think that consequentialism is true.
Section 3 above presented several objections to consequentialism, arguing that consequentialism conflicts with one or another basic piece of common sense about morality. But in reply to most of these objections, Section 3 presented arguments to show that consequentialism supports those bits of common sense after all.
A worry about this line of thought is that if there were some simple theory like consequentialism that captured what morality is about, one might think that we would have recognized it long ago. But consequentialism is still controversial.
(For more discussion of consequentialism, see the consequentialism section of the article Ethics.)
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Most of the best recent work on consequentialism is collected in the following anthologies. Any one of these collections provides an excellent introduction to consequentialism. In addition, the fine journal Utilitas is entirely devoted to the topic.
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