Continental Rationalism

Continental rationalism is a retrospective category used to group together certain philosophers working in continental Europe in the 17th and 18th centuries, in particular, Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz, especially as they can be regarded in contrast with representatives of “British empiricism,” most notably, Locke, Berkeley, and Hume. Whereas the British empiricists held that all knowledge has its origin in, and is limited by, experience, the Continental rationalists thought that knowledge has its foundation in the scrutiny and orderly deployment of ideas and principles proper to the mind itself. The rationalists did not spurn experience as is sometimes mistakenly alleged; they were thoroughly immersed in the rapid developments of the new science, and in some cases led those developments. They held, however, that experience alone, while useful in practical matters, provides an inadequate foundation for genuine knowledge.

The fact that “Continental rationalism” and “British empiricism” are retrospectively applied terms does not mean that the distinction that they signify is anachronistic. Leibniz’s New Essays on Human Understanding, for instance, outlines stark contrasts between his own way of thinking and that of Locke, which track many features of the rationalist/empiricist distinction as it tends to be applied in retrospect. There was no rationalist creed or manifesto to which Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz all subscribed (nor, for that matter, was there an empiricist one). Nevertheless, with due caution, it is possible to use the “Continental rationalism” category (and its empiricist counterpart) to highlight significant points of convergence in the philosophies of Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz, inter alia. These include: (1) a doctrine of innate ideas; (2) the application of mathematical method to philosophy; and (3) the use of a priori principles in the construction of substance-based metaphysical systems.

Table of Contents

  1. Origin and History of the Term "Rationalism"
  2. Innate Ideas
    1. Descartes
    2. Spinoza
    3. Leibniz
    4. Malebranche
  3. Mathematical Method
    1. Descartes
    2. Spinoza
    3. Leibniz
  4. A Priori Principles
    1. Intelligibility and the Cartesian Circle
    2. Substance Metaphysics
      1. Descartes
      2. Spinoza
      3. Leibniz
  5. Continental Rationalism, Experience, and Experiment
    1. Descartes
    2. Spinoza
    3. Leibniz
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Origin and History of the Term "Rationalism"

According to the Historisches Worterbuch der Philosophie, the word “rationaliste” appears in 16th century France, as early as 1539, in opposition to “empirique.” In his New Organon, first published in 1620 (in Latin), Francis Bacon juxtaposes rationalism and empiricism in memorable terms:

Those who have treated of the sciences have been either empiricists [Empirici] or dogmatists [Dogmatici]. Empiricists [Empirici], like ants, simply accumulate and use; Rationalists [Rationales], like spiders, spin webs from themselves; the way of the bee is in between: it takes material from the flowers of the garden and the field; but it has the ability to convert and digest them. (The New Organon, p. 79; Spedding, 1, 201)

Bacon’s association of rationalists with dogmatists in this passage foreshadows Kant’s use of the term “dogmatisch” in reference, especially, to the Wolffian brand of rationalist philosophy prevalent in 18th century Germany. Nevertheless, Bacon’s use of “rationales” does not refer to “Continental rationalism,” which developed only after the New Organon, but rather to the Scholastic philosophy that dominated the medieval period. Moreover, while Bacon is, in retrospect, often considered the father of modern empiricism, the above-quoted passage shows him no friendlier to the empirici than to the rationales. Thus, Bacon’s juxtaposition of rationalism and empiricism should not be confused with the distinction as it develops over the course of the 17th and 18th centuries, although his imagery is certainly suggestive.

The distinction appears in an influential form as the backdrop to Kant’s critical philosophy (which is often loosely understood as a kind of synthesis of certain aspects of Continental rationalism and British empiricism) at the end of the 18th century. However, it was not until the time of Hegel in the first half of the 19th century that the terms “rationalism” and “empiricism” were applied to separating the figures of the 17th and 18th centuries into contrasting epistemological camps in the fashion with which we are familiar today. In his Lectures on the History of Philosophy, Hegel describes an opposition between “a priori thought,” on the one hand, according to which “the determinations which should be valid for thought should be taken from thought itself,” and, on the other hand, “the determination that we must begin and end and think, etc., from experience.” He describes this as the opposition between “Rationalismus and “Empirismus” (Werke 20, 121).

2. Innate Ideas

Perhaps the best recognized and most commonly made distinction between rationalists and empiricists concerns the question of the source of ideas. Whereas rationalists tend to think (with some exceptions discussed below) that some ideas, at least, such as the idea of God, are innate, empiricists hold that all ideas come from experience. Although the rationalists tend to be remembered for their positive doctrine concerning innate ideas, their assertions are matched by a rejection of the notion that all ideas can be accounted for on the basis of experience alone. In some Continental rationalists, especially in Spinoza, the negative doctrine is more apparent than the positive. The distinction is worth bearing in mind, in order to avoid the very false impression that the rationalists held to innate ideas because the empiricist alternative had not come along yet. (In general, the British empiricists came after the rationalists.) The Aristotelian doctrine, nihil in intellectu nisi prius in sensu (nothing in the intellect unless first in the senses), had been dominant for centuries, and it was in reaction against this that the rationalists revived in modified form the contrasting Platonic doctrine of innate ideas.

a. Descartes

Descartes distinguishes between three kinds of ideas: adventitious (adventitiae), factitious (factae), and innate (innatae). As an example of an adventitious idea, Descartes gives the common idea of the sun (yellow, bright, round) as it is perceived through the senses. As an example of a factitious idea, Descartes cites the idea of the sun constructed via astronomical reasoning (vast, gaseous body). According to Descartes, all ideas which represent “true, immutable, and eternal essences” are innate. Innate ideas, for Descartes, include the idea of God, the mind, and mathematical truths, such as the fact that it pertains to the nature of a triangle that its three angles equal two right angles.

By conceiving some ideas as innate, Descartes does not mean that children are born with fully actualized conceptions of, for example, triangles and their properties. This is a common misconception of the rationalist doctrine of innate ideas. Descartes strives to correct it in Comments on a Certain Broadsheet, where he compares the innateness of ideas in the mind to the tendency which some babies are born with to contract certain diseases: “it is not so much that the babies of such families suffer from these diseases in their mother’s womb, but simply that they are born with a certain ‘faculty’ or tendency to contract them” (CSM I, 304). In other words, innate ideas exist in the mind potentially, as tendencies; they are then actualized by means of active thought under certain circumstances, such as seeing a triangular figure.

At various points, Descartes defends his doctrine of innate ideas against philosophers (Hobbes, Gassendi, and Regius, inter alia) who hold that all ideas enter the mind through the senses, and that there are no ideas apart from images. Descartes is relatively consistent on his reasons for thinking that some ideas, at least, must be innate. His principal line of argument proceeds by showing that there are certain ideas, for example, the idea of a triangle, that cannot be either adventitious or factitious; since ideas are either adventitious, factitious, or innate, by process of elimination, such ideas must be innate.

Take Descartes’ favorite example of the idea of a triangle. The argument that the idea of a triangle cannot be adventitious proceeds roughly as follows. A triangle is composed of straight lines. However, straight lines never enter our mind via the senses, since when we examine straight lines under a magnifying lens, they turn out to be wavy or irregular in some way. Since we cannot derive the idea of straight lines from the senses, we cannot derive the idea of a true triangle, which is made up of straight lines, through the senses. Sometimes Descartes makes the point in slightly different terms by insisting that there is “no similarity” between the corporeal motions of the sense organs and the ideas formed in the mind on the occasion of those motions (CSM I, 304; CSMK III, 187). One such dissimilarity, which is particularly striking, is the contrast between the particularity of all corporeal motions and the universality that pure ideas can attain when conjoined to form necessary truths. Descartes makes this point in clear terms to Regius:

I would like our author to tell me what the corporeal motion is that is capable of forming some common notion to the effect that ‘things which are equal to a third thing are equal to each other,’ or any other he cares to take. For all such motions are particular, whereas the common notions are universal and bear no affinity with, or relation to, the motions. (CSM I, 304-5)

Next, Descartes has to show that the idea of a triangle is not factitious. This is where the doctrine of “true and immutable natures” comes in. For Descartes, if, for example, the idea that the three angles of a triangle are equal to two right angles were his own invention, it would be mutable, like the idea of a gold mountain, which can be changed at whim into the idea of a silver mountain. Instead, when Descartes thinks about his idea of a triangle, he is able to discover eternal properties of it that are not mutable in this way; hence, they are not invented (CSMK III, 184).

Since, therefore, the triangle can be neither adventitious nor factitious, it must be innate; that is to say, the mind has an innate tendency or power to form this idea from its own purely intellectual resources when prompted to do so.

Descartes’ insistence that there is no similarity between the corporeal motions of our sense organs and the ideas formed in the mind on the occasion of those motions raises a difficulty for understanding how any ideas could be adventitious. Since none of our ideas have any similarity to the corporeal motions of the sense organs – even the idea of motion itself – it seems that no ideas can in fact have their origin in a source external to the mind. The reason that we have an idea of heat in the presence of fire, for instance, is not, then, because the idea is somehow transmitted by the fire. Rather, Descartes thinks that God designed us in such a way that we form the idea of heat on the occasion of certain corporeal motions in our sense organs (and we form other sensory ideas on the occasion of other corporeal motions). Thus, there is a sense in which, for Descartes, all ideas are innate, and his tripartite division between kinds of ideas becomes difficult to maintain.

b. Spinoza

Per his so-called doctrine of “parallelism,” Spinoza conceives the mind and the body as one and the same thing, conceived under different attributes (to wit, thought and extension). (See Benedict de Spinoza: Metaphysics.) As a result, Spinoza denies that there is any causal interaction between mind and body, and so Spinoza denies that any ideas are caused by bodily change. Just as bodies can be affected only by other bodies, so ideas can be affected only by other ideas. This does not mean, however, that all ideas are innate for Spinoza, as they very clearly are for Leibniz (see below). Just as the body can be conceived to be affected by external objects conceived under the attribute of extension (that is, as bodies), so the mind can (as it were, in parallel) be conceived to be affected by the same objects conceived under the attribute of thought (that is, as ideas). Ideas gained in this way, from encounters with external objects (conceived as ideas) constitutes knowledge of the first kind, or “imagination,” for Spinoza, and all such ideas are “inadequate,” or in other words, confused and lacking order for the intellect. “Adequate ideas,” on the other hand, which can be formed via Spinoza’s second and third kinds of knowledge (reason and intuitive knowledge, respectively), and which are clear and distinct and have order for the intellect, are not gained through chance encounters with external objects; rather, adequate ideas can be explained in terms of resources intrinsic to the mind. (For more on Spinoza’s three kinds of knowledge and the distinction between adequate and inadequate ideas, see Benedict de Spinoza: Epistemology.)

The mind, for Spinoza, just by virtue of having ideas, which is its essence, has ideas of what Spinoza calls “common notions,” or in other words, those things which are “equally in the part and in the whole.” Examples of common notions include motion and rest, extension, and indeed God. Take extension for example. To think of any body – however small or however large – is to have a perfectly complete idea of extension. So, insofar as the mind has any idea of body (and, for Spinoza, the human mind is the idea of the human body, and so always has ideas of body), it has a perfectly adequate idea of extension. The same can be said for motion and rest. The same can also be said for God, except that God is not equally in the part and in the whole of extension only, but of all things. Spinoza treats these common notions as principles of reasoning. Anything that can be deduced on their basis is also adequate.

It is not clear if Spinoza’s common notions should be considered innate ideas. Spinoza speaks of active and passive ideas, and adequate and inadequate ideas. He associates the former with the intellect and the latter with the imagination, but “innate idea” is not an explicit category in Spinoza’s theory of ideas as it is in Descartes’ and also Leibniz’s. Common notions are not “in” the mind independent of the mind’s relation with its object (the body); nevertheless, since it is the mind’s nature to be the idea of the body, it is part of the mind’s nature to have common notions. Commentators differ over the question of whether Spinoza had a positive doctrine of innate ideas; it is clear, however, that he denied that all ideas come about through encounters with external objects; moreover, he believed that those ideas which do come about through encounters with external objects are of an inferior epistemic value than those produced through the mind’s own intrinsic resources; this is enough to put him in the rationalist camp on the question of the origin of ideas.

c. Leibniz

Of the three great rationalists, Leibniz propounded the most thoroughgoing doctrine of innate ideas. For Leibniz, all ideas are strictly speaking innate. In a general and relatively straightforward sense, this viewpoint is a direct consequence of Leibniz’s conception of individual substance. According to Leibniz, “each substance is a world apart, independent of everything outside of itself except for God. Thus all our phenomena, that is to say, all the things that can ever happen to us, are only the results of our own being” (L, 312); or, in Leibniz’s famous phrase from the Monadology, “monads have no windows,” meaning there is no way for sensory data to enter monads from the outside. In this more general sense, then, to give an explanation for Leibniz’s doctrine of innate ideas would be to explain his conception of individual substance and the arguments and considerations which motivate it. (See Section 4, b, iii, below for a discussion of Leibniz’s conception of substance; see also Gottfried Leibniz: Metaphysics.) This would be to circumvent the issues and questions which are typically at the heart of the debate over the existence of innate ideas, which concern the extent to which certain kinds of perceptions, ideas, and propositions can be accounted for on the basis of experience. Although Leibniz’s more general reasons for embracing innate ideas stem from his unique brand of substance metaphysics, Leibniz does enter into the debate over innate ideas, as it were, addressing the more specific questions regarding the source of given kinds of ideas, most notably in his dialogic engagement with Locke’s philosophy, New Essays on Human Understanding.

Due to Leibniz’s conception of individual substance, nothing actually comes from a sensory experience, where a sensory experience is understood to involve direct concourse with things outside of the mind. However, Leibniz does have a means for distinguishing between sensations and purely intellectual thoughts within the framework of his substance metaphysics. For Leibniz, although each monad or individual substance “expresses” (or represents) the entire universe from its own unique point of view, it does so with a greater or lesser degree of clarity and distinctness. Bare monads, such as comprise minerals and vegetation, express the rest of the world only in the most confused fashion. Rational minds, by contrast, have a much greater proportion of clear and distinct perceptions, and so express more of the world clearly and distinctly than do bare monads. When an individual substance attains a more perfect expression of the world (in the sense that it attains a less confused expression of the world), it is said to act; when its expression becomes more confused, it is said to be acted upon. Using this distinction, Leibniz is able to reconcile the terms of his philosophy with everyday conceptions. Although, strictly speaking, no monad is acted upon by any other, nor acts upon any other directly, it is possible to speak this way, just as, Leibniz says, Copernicans can still speak of the motion of the sun for everyday purposes, while understanding that the sun does not in fact move. It is in this sense that Leibniz enters into the debate concerning the origin of our ideas.

Leibniz distinguishes between “ideas” (idées) and “thoughts” (pensées) (or, sometimes, “notions” (notions) or “concepts” (conceptus)). Ideas exist in the soul whether we actually perceive them or are aware of them or not. It is these “ideas” that Leibniz contends are innate. “Thoughts,” by contrast is Leibniz’s designation for ideas which we actually form or conceive at any given time. In this sense, “thoughts” can be formed on the basis of a sensory experience (with the above caveats regarding the meaning a sensory experience can have in Leibniz’s thought) or on the basis of an internal experience, or a reflection. Leibniz alternatively characterizes our “ideas” as “aptitudes,” “preformations,” and as “dispositions” to represent something when the occasion for thinking of it arises. On multiple occasions, Leibniz uses the metaphor of the veins present in marble to illustrate his understanding of innate ideas. Just as the veins dispose the sculptor to shape the marble in certain ways, so do our ideas dispose us to have certain thoughts on the occasion of certain experiences.

Leibniz rejects the view that the mind cannot have ideas without being aware that it has them. (See Gottfried Leibniz: Philosophy of Mind.) Much of the disagreement between Locke and Leibniz on the question of innate ideas turns on this point, since Locke (at least as Leibniz represents him in the New Essays) is not able to make any sense out of the notion that the mind can have ideas without being aware of them. Much of Leibniz’s defense of his innate ideas doctrine takes the form of replying to Locke’s charge that it is absurd to hold that the mind could think (that is, have ideas) without being aware of it.

Leibniz marshals several considerations in support of his view that the mind is not always aware of its ideas. The fact that we can store many more ideas in our understanding than we can be aware of at any given time is one. Leibniz also points to the phenomenology of attention; we do not attend to everything in our perceptual field at any given time; rather we focus on certain things at the expense of others. To convey a sense of what it might be like for the mind to have perceptions and ideas in a dreamless sleep, Leibniz asks the reader to imagine subtracting our attention from perceptual experience; since we can distinguish between what is attended to and what is not, subtracting attention does not eliminate perception altogether.

While such considerations suggest the possibility of innate ideas, they do not in and of themselves prove that innate ideas are necessary to explain the full scope of human cognition. The empiricist tends to think that if innate ideas are not necessary to explain cognition, then they should be abandoned as gratuitous metaphysical constructs. Leibniz does have arguments designed to show that innate ideas are needed for a full account of human cognition.

In the first place, Leibniz recalls favorably the famous scenario from Plato’s Meno where Socrates teaches a slave boy to grasp abstract mathematical truths merely by asking questions. The anecdote is supposed to indicate that mathematical truths can be generated by the mind alone, in the absence of particular sensory experiences, if only the mind is prompted to discover what it contains within itself. Concerning mathematics and geometry, Leibniz remarks: “one could construct these sciences in one’s study and even with one’s eyes closed, without learning from sight or even from touch any of the needed truths” (NE, 77). So, on these grounds, Leibniz contends that without innate ideas, we could not explain the sorts of cognitive capacities exhibited in the mathematical sciences.

A second argument concerns our capacity to grasp certain necessary or eternal truths. Leibniz says that necessary truths can be suggested, justified, and confirmed by experience, but that they can be proved only by the understanding alone (NE, 80). Leibniz does not explain this point further, but he seems to have in mind the point later made by both Hume and Kant (to different ends), that experience on its own can never account for the kind of certainty that we find in mathematical and metaphysical truths. For Leibniz, if it can be granted that we can be certain of propositions in mathematics and metaphysics – and Leibniz thinks this must be granted – recourse must be had to principles innate to the mind in order to explain our ability to be certain of such things.

d. Malebranche

It is worth noting briefly the position of Nicolas Malebranche on innate ideas, since Malebranche is often considered among the rationalists, yet he denied the doctrine of innate ideas. Malebranche’s reasons for rejecting innate ideas were anything but empiricist in nature, however. His leading objection stems from the infinity of ideas that the mind is able to form independently of the senses; as an example, Malebranche cites the infinite number of triangles of which the mind could in principle, albeit not in practice, form ideas. Unlike Descartes and Leibniz, who view innate ideas as tendencies or dispositions to form certain thoughts under certain circumstances, Malebranche understands them as fully formed entities that would have to exist somehow in the mind were they to exist there innately. Given this conception, Malebranche finds it unlikely that God would have created “so many things along with the mind of man” (The Search After Truth, p. 227). Since God already contains the ideas of all things within Himself, Malebranche thinks that it would be much more economical if God were simply to reveal to us the ideas of things that already exist in him rather than placing an infinity of ideas in each human mind. Malebranche’s tenet that “we see all things in God” thus follows upon the principle that God always acts in the simplest ways. Malebranche finds further support for this doctrine from the fact that it places human minds in a position of complete dependence on God. Thus, if Malebranche’s rejection of innate ideas distinguishes him from other rationalists, it does so not from an empiricist standpoint, but rather because of the extent to which his position on ideas is theologically motivated.

3. Mathematical Method

In one sense, what it means to be a rationalist is to model philosophy on mathematics, and, in particular, geometry. This means that the rationalist begins with definitions and intuitively self-evident axioms and proceeds thence to deduce a philosophical system of knowledge that is both certain and complete. This at least is the goal and (with some qualifications to be explored below) the claim. In no work of rationalist philosophy is this procedure more apparent than in Spinoza’s Ethics, laid out famously in the geometrical manner (more geometrico). Nevertheless, Descartes’ main works (and those of Leibniz as well), although not as overtly more geometrico as Spinoza’s Ethics, are also modelled after geometry, and it is Descartes’ celebrated methodological program that first introduces mathematics as a model for philosophy.

a. Descartes

Perhaps Descartes’ clearest and most well-known statement of mathematics’ role as paradigm appears in the Discourse on the Method:

Those long chains of very simple and easy reasonings, which geometers customarily use to arrive at their most difficult demonstrations, had given me occasion to suppose that all the things which can fall under human knowledge are interconnected in the same way. (CSM I, 120)

However, Descartes’ promotion of mathematics as a model for philosophy dates back to his early, unfinished work, Rules for the Direction of the Mind. It is in this work that Descartes first outlines his standards for certainty that have since come to be so closely associated with him and with the rationalist enterprise more generally.

In Rule 2, Descartes declares that henceforth only what is certain should be valued and counted as knowledge. This means the rejection of all merely probable reasoning, which Descartes associates with the philosophy of the Schools. Descartes admits that according to this criterion, only arithmetic and geometry thus far count as knowledge. But Descartes does not conclude that only in these disciplines is it possible to attain knowledge. According to Descartes, the reason that certainty has eluded philosophers has as much to do with the disdain that philosophers have for the simplest truths as it does with the subject matter. Admittedly, the objects of arithmetic and geometry are especially pure and simple, or, as Descartes will later say, “clear and distinct.” Nevertheless, certainty can be attained in philosophy as well, provided the right method is followed.

Descartes distinguishes between two ways of achieving knowledge: “through experience and through deduction […] [W]e must note that while our experiences of things are often deceptive, the deduction or pure inference of one thing from another can never be performed wrongly by an intellect which is in the least degree rational […]” (CSM I, 12). This is a clear statement of Descartes’ methodological rationalism. Building up knowledge through accumulated experience can only ever lead to the sort of probable knowledge that Descartes finds lacking. “Pure inference,” by contrast,” can never go astray, at least when it is conducted by right reason. Of course, the truth value of a deductive chain is only as good as the first truths, or axioms, whose truth the deductions preserve. It is for this reason that Descartes’ method relies on intuition as well as deduction. Intuition provides the first principles of a deductive system, for Descartes. Intuition differs from deduction insofar as it is not discursive. Intuition grasps its object in an immediate way. In its broadest outlines, Descartes’ method is just the use of intuition and deduction in the orderly attainment and preservation of certainty.

In subsequent Rules, Descartes goes on to elaborate a more specific methodological program, which involves reducing complicated matters step by step to simpler, intuitively graspable truths, and then using those simple truths as principles from which to deduce knowledge of more complicated matters. It is generally accepted by scholars that this more specific methodological program reappears in a more iconic form in the Discourse on the Method as the four rules for gaining knowledge outlined in Part 2. There is some doubt as to the extent to which this more specific methodological program actually plays any role in Descartes’ mature philosophy as it is expressed in the Meditations and Principles (see Garber 2001, chapter 2). There can be no doubt, however, that the broader methodological guidelines outlined above were a permanent feature of Descartes’ thought.

In response to a request to cast his Meditations in the geometrical style (that is, in the style of Euclid’s Elements), Descartes distinguishes between two aspects of the geometrical style: order and method, explaining:

The order consists simply in this. The items which are put forward first must be known entirely without the aid of what comes later; and the remaining items must be arranged in such a way that their demonstration depends solely on what has gone before. I did try to follow this order very carefully in my Meditations […] (CSM II, 110)

Elsewhere, Descartes contrasts this order, which he calls the “order of reasons,” with another order, which he associates with scholasticism, and which he calls the “order of subject-matter” (see CSMK III, 163). What Descartes understands as “geometrical order” or the “order of reasons” is just the procedure of starting with what is most simple, and proceeding in a step-wise, deliberate fashion to deduce consequences from there. Descartes’ order is governed by what can be clearly and distinctly intuited, and by what can be clearly and distinctly inferred from such self-evident intuitions (rather than by a concern for organizing the discussion into neat topical categories per the order of subject-matter)

As for method, Descartes distinguishes between analysis and synthesis. For Descartes, analysis and synthesis represent different methods of demonstrating a conclusion or set of conclusions. Analysis exhibits the path by which the conclusion comes to be grasped. As such, it can be thought of as the order of discovery or order of knowledge. Synthesis, by contrast, wherein conclusions are deduced from a series of definitions, postulates, and axioms, as in Euclid’s Elements, for instance, follows not the order in which things are discovered, but rather the order that things bear to one another in reality. As such, it can be thought of as the order of being. God, for example, is prior to the human mind in the order of being (since God created the human mind), and so in the synthetic mode of demonstration the existence of God is demonstrated before the existence of the human mind. However, knowledge of one’s own mind precedes knowledge of God, at least in Descartes’ philosophy, and so in the analytic mode of demonstration the cogito is demonstrated before the existence of God. Descartes’ preference is for analysis, because he thinks that it is superior in helping the reader to discover the things for herself, and so in bringing about the intellectual conversion which it is the Meditations’ goal to effectuate in the minds of its readers. According to Descartes, while synthesis, in laying out demonstrations systematically, is useful in preempting dissent, it is inferior in engaging the mind of the reader.

Two primary distinctions can be made in summarizing Descartes’ methodology: (1) the distinction between the order of reasons and the order of subject-matter; and (2) the analysis/synthesis distinction. With respect to the first distinction, the great Continental rationalists are united. All adhere to the order of reasons, as we have described it above, rather than the order of subject-matter. Even though the rationalists disagree about how exactly to interpret the content of the order of reasons, their common commitment to following an order of reasons is a hallmark of their rationalism. Although there are points of convergence with respect to the second, analysis/synthesis distinction, there are also clear points of divergence, and this distinction can be useful in highlighting the range of approaches the rationalists adopt to mathematical methodology.

b. Spinoza

Of the great Continental rationalists, Spinoza is the most closely associated with mathematical method due to the striking presentation of his magnum opus, the Ethics, (as well as his presentation of Descartes’ Principles), in geometrical fashion. The fact that Spinoza is the only major rationalist to present his main work more geometrico might create the impression that he is the only philosopher to employ mathematical method in constructing and elaborating his philosophical system. This impression is mistaken, since both Descartes and Leibniz also apply mathematical method to philosophy. Nevertheless, there are differences between Spinoza’s employment of mathematical method and that of Descartes (and Leibniz). The most striking, of course, is the form of Spinoza’s Ethics. Each part begins with a series of definitions, axioms, and postulates and proceeds thence to deduce propositions, the demonstrations of which refer back to the definitions, axioms, postulates and previously demonstrated propositions on which they depend. Of course, this is just the method of presenting findings that Descartes in the Second Replies dubbed “synthesis.” For Descartes, analysis and synthesis differ only in pedagogical respects: whereas analysis is better for helping the reader discover the truth for herself, synthesis is better in compelling agreement.

There is some evidence that Spinoza’s motivations for employing synthesis were in part pedagogical. In Lodewijk Meyer’s preface to Spinoza’s Principles of Cartesian Philosophy, Meyer uses Descartes’ Second Replies distinction between analysis and synthesis to explain the motivation for the work. Meyer criticizes Descartes’ followers for being too uncritical in their enthusiasm for Descartes’ thought, and attributes this in part to the relative opacity of Descartes’ analytic mode of presentation. Thus, for Meyer, the motivation for presenting Descartes’ Principles in the synthetic manner is to make the proofs more transparent, and thereby leave less excuse for blind acceptance of Descartes’ conclusions. It is not clear to what extent Meyer’s explanation of the mode of presentation of Spinoza’s Principles of Cartesian Philosophy applies to Spinoza’s Ethics. In the first place, although Spinoza approved the preface, he did not author it himself. Secondly, while such an explanation seems especially suited to a work in which Spinoza’s chief goal was to present another philosopher’s thought in a different form, there is no reason to assume that it applies to the presentation of Spinoza’s own philosophy. Scholars have differed on how to interpret the geometrical form of Spinoza’s Ethics. However, it is generally accepted that Spinoza’s use of synthesis does not merely represent a pedagogical preference. There is reason to think that Spinoza’s methodology differs from that of Descartes in a somewhat deeper way.

There is another version of the analysis/synthesis distinction besides Descartes’ that was also influential in the 17th century, that is, Hobbes’ version of the distinction. Although there is little direct evidence that Spinoza was influenced by Hobbes’ version of the distinction, some scholars have claimed a connection, and, in any case, it is useful to view Spinoza’s methodology in light of the Hobbesian alternative.

Synthesis and analysis are not modes of demonstrating findings that have already been made, for Hobbes, as they are for Descartes, but rather complementary means of generating findings; in particular, they are forms of causal reasoning. For Hobbes, analysis is reasoning from effects to causes; synthesis is reasoning in the other direction, from causes to effects. For example, by analysis, we infer that geometrical objects are constructed via the motions of points and lines and surfaces. Once motion has been established as the principle of geometry, it is then possible, via synthesis, to construct the possible effects of motion, and thereby, to make new discoveries in geometry. According to the Hobbesian schema, then, synthesis is not merely a mode of presenting truths, but a means of generating and discovering truths. (For Hobbes’ method, see The English Works of Thomas Hobbes of Malmesbury, vol. 1, ch. 6.) There is reason to think that synthesis had this kind of significance for Spinoza, as well – as a means of discovery, not merely presentation. Spinoza’s methodology, and, in particular, his theory of definitions, bear this out

Spinoza’s method begins with reflection on the nature of a “given true idea.” The “given true idea” serves as a standard by which the mind learns the distinction between true and false ideas, and also between the intellect and the imagination, and how to direct itself properly in the discovery of true ideas. The correct formulation of definitions emerges as the most important factor in directing the mind properly in the discovery of true ideas. To illustrate his conception of a good definition, Spinoza contrasts two definitions of a circle. On one definition, a circle is a figure in which all the lines from the center to the circumference are equal. On another, a circle is the figure described by the rotation of a line around one of its ends, which is fixed. For Spinoza, the second definition is superior. Whereas the first definition gives only a property of the circle, the second provides the cause from which all of the properties can be deduced. Hence, what makes a definition a good definition, for Spinoza, is its capacity to serve as a basis for the discovery of truths about the thing. The circle, of course, is just an example. For Spinoza, the method is perfected when it arrives at a true idea of the first cause of all things, that is, God. Only the method is perfected with a true idea of God, however, not the philosophy. The philosophy itself begins with a true idea of God, since the philosophy consists in deducing the consequences from a true idea of God. With this in mind, the definition of God is of paramount importance. In correspondence, Spinoza compares contrasting definitions of God, explaining that he chose the one which expresses the efficient cause from which all of the properties of God can be deduced.

In this light, it becomes clear that the geometrical presentation of Spinoza’s philosophy is not merely a pedagogic preference. The definitions that appear at the outset of the five parts of the Ethics do not serve merely to make explicit what might otherwise have remained only implicit in Descartes’ analytic mode of presentation. Rather, key definitions, such as the definition of God, are principles that underwrite the development of the system. As a result, Hobbes’ conception of the analysis/synthesis distinction throws an important light on Spinoza’s procedure. There is a movement of analysis in arriving at the causal definition of God from the preliminary “given true idea.” Then there is a movement of synthesis in deducing consequences from that causal definition. Of course, Descartes’ analysis/synthesis distinction still applies, since, after all, Spinoza’s system is presented in the synthetic manner in the Ethics. But the geometrical style of presentation is not merely a pedagogical device in Spinoza’s case. It is also a clue to the nature of his system.

c. Leibniz

Leibniz is openly critical of Descartes’ distinction between analysis and synthesis, writing, “Those who think that the analytic presentation consists in revealing the origin of a discovery, the synthetic in keeping it concealed, are in error” (L, 233). This comment is aimed at Descartes’ formulation of the distinction in the Second Replies. Leibniz is explicit about his adherence to the viewpoint that seems to be implied by Spinoza’s methodology: synthesis is itself a means of discovering truth no less than analysis, not merely a mode of presentation. Leibniz’s understanding of analysis and synthesis is closer to the Hobbesian conception, which views analysis and synthesis as different directions of causal reasoning: from effects to causes (analysis) and from causes to effects (synthesis). Leibniz formulates the distinction in his own terms as follows:

Synthesis is achieved when we begin from principles and run through truths in good order, thus discovering certain progressions and setting up tables, or sometimes general formulas, in which the answers to emerging questions can later be discovered. Analysis goes back to the principles in order to solve the given problems only […] (L, 232)

Leibniz thus conceives synthesis and analysis in relation to principles.

Leibniz lays great stress on the importance of establishing the possibility of ideas, that is to say, establishing that ideas do not involve contradiction, and this applies a fortiori to first principles. For Leibniz, the Cartesian criterion of clear and distinct perception does not suffice for establishing the possibility of an idea. Leibniz is critical, in particular, of Descartes’ ontological argument on the grounds that Descartes neglects to demonstrate the possibility of the idea of a most perfect being on which the argument depends. It is possible to mistakenly assume that an idea is possible, when in reality it is contradictory. Leibniz gives the example of a wheel turning at the fastest possible rate. It might at first seem that this idea is legitimate, but if a spoke of the wheel were extended beyond the rim, the end of the spoke would move faster than a nail in the rim itself, revealing a contradiction in the original notion.

For Leibniz, there are two ways of establishing the possibility of an idea: by experience (a posteriori) and by reducing concepts via analysis down to a relation of identity (a priori). Leibniz credits mathematicians and geometers with pushing the practice of demonstrating what would otherwise normally be taken for granted the furthest. For example, in Meditations on Knowledge, Truth, and Ideas, Leibniz writes, “That brilliant genius Pascal agrees entirely with these principles when he says, in his famous dissertation on the geometrical spirit […] that it is the task of the geometer to define all terms though ever so little obscure and to prove all truths though little doubtful” (L, 294). Leibniz credits his own doctrine of the possibility of ideas with clarifying exactly what it means for something to be beyond doubt and obscurity.

Leibniz describes the result of the reduction of concepts to identity variously as follows: when the thing is resolved into simple primitive notions understood in themselves (L, 231); “when every ingredient that enters into a distinct concept is itself known distinctly”; “when analysis is carried through to the end” (L, 292). Since, for Leibniz, all true ideas can be reduced to simple identities, it is, in principle, possible to derive all truths via a movement of synthesis from such simple identities in the way that mathematicians produce systems of knowledge on the basis of their basic definitions and axioms. This kind of a priori knowledge of the world is restricted to God, however. According to Leibniz, it is only possible for our finite minds to have this kind of knowledge – which Leibniz calls “intuitive” or “adequate” – in the case of things which do not depend on experience, or what Leibniz also calls “truths of reason,” which include abstract logical and metaphysical truths, and mathematical propositions. In the case of “truths of fact,” by contrast, with the exception of immediately graspable facts of experience, such as, “I think,” and “Various things are thought by me,” we are restricted to formulating hypotheses to explain the phenomena of sensory experience, and such knowledge of the world can, for us, only ever achieve the status of hypothesis, though our hypothetical knowledge can be continually improved and refined. (See Section 5, c, below for a discussion of hypotheses in Leibniz.)

Leibniz is in line with his rationalist predecessors in emphasizing the importance of proper order in philosophizing. Leibniz’s emphasis on establishing the possibility of ideas prior to using them in demonstrating propositions could be understood as a refinement of the geometrical order that Descartes established over against the order of subject-matter. Leibniz emphasizes order in another connection vis-à-vis Locke. As Leibniz makes clear in his New Essays, one of the clearest points of disagreement between him and Locke is on the question of innate ideas. In preliminary comments that Leibniz drew up upon first reading Locke’s Essay, and which he sent to Locke via Burnett, Leibniz makes the following point regarding philosophical order:

Concerning the question whether there are ideas and truths born with us, I do not find it absolutely necessary for the beginnings, nor for the practice of the art of thinking, to answer it; whether they all come to us from outside, or they come from within us, we will reason correctly provided that we keep in mind what I said above, and that we proceed with order and without prejudice. The question of the origin of our ideas and of our maxims is not preliminary in philosophy, and it is necessary to have made great progress in order to resolve it. (Philosophische Schriften, vol. 5, pp. 15-16)

Leibniz’s allusion to what he “said above” refers to remarks regarding the establishment of the possibility of ideas via experience and the principle of identity. This passage makes it clear that, from Leibniz’s point of view, the order in which Locke philosophizes is quite misguided, since Locke begins with a question that should only be addressed after “great progress” has already been made, particularly with respect to the criteria for distinguishing between true and false ideas, and for establishing legitimate philosophical principles. Empiricists generally put much less emphasis on the order of philosophizing, since they do not aim to reason from first principles grasped a priori.

4. A Priori Principles

A fundamental tenet of rationalism – perhaps the fundamental tenet – is that the world is intelligible. The intelligibility tenet means that everything that happens in the world happens in an orderly, lawful, rational manner, and that the mind, in principle, if not always in practice, is able to reproduce the interconnections of things in thought provided that it adheres to certain rules of right reasoning. The intelligibility of the world is sometimes couched in terms of a denial of brute facts, where a “brute fact” is something that “just is the case,” that is, something that obtains without any reason or explanation (even in principle). Many of the a priori principles associated with rationalism can be understood either as versions or implications of the principle of intelligibility. As such, the principle of intelligibility functions as a basic principle of rationalism. It appears under various guises in the great rationalist systems and is used to generate contrasting philosophical systems. Indeed, one of the chief criticisms of rationalism is the fact that its principles can consistently be used to generate contradictory conclusions and systems of thought. The clearest and best known statement of the intelligibility of the world is Leibniz’s principle of sufficient reason. Some scholars have recently emphasized this principle as the key to understanding rationalism (see Della Rocca 2008, chapter 1).

The intelligibility principle raises some classic philosophical problems. Chief among these is a problem of question-begging or circularity. The task of proving that the world is intelligible seems to have to rely on some of the very principles of reasoning in question. In the 17th century, discussion of this fundamental problem centered around the so-called “Cartesian circle.” The problem is still debated by scholars of 17th century thought today. The viability of the rationalist enterprise seems to depend, at least in part, on a satisfactory answer to this problem.

a. Intelligibility and the Cartesian Circle

The most important rational principle in Descartes’ philosophy, the principle which does a great deal of the work in generating its details, is the principle according to which whatever is clearly and distinctly perceived to be true is true. This principle means that if we can form any clear and distinct ideas, then we will be able to trust that they accurately represent their objects, and give us certain knowledge of reality. Descartes’ clear and distinct ideas doctrine is central to his conception of the world’s intelligibility, and indeed, it is central to the rationalists’ conception of the world’s intelligibility more broadly. Although Spinoza and Leibniz both work to refine understanding of what it is to have clear and distinct ideas, they both subscribe to the view that the mind, when directed properly, is able to accurately represent certain basic features of reality, such as the nature of substance.

For Descartes, it cannot be taken for granted from the outset that what we clearly and distinctly perceive to be true is in fact true. It is possible to entertain the doubt that an all-powerful deceiving being fashioned the mind so that it is deceived even in those things it perceives clearly and distinctly. Nevertheless, it is only possible to entertain this doubt when we are not having clear and distinct perceptions. When we are perceiving things clearly and distinctly, their truth is undeniable. Moreover, we can use our capacity for clear and distinct perceptions to demonstrate that the mind was not fashioned by an all-powerful deceiving being, but rather by an all-powerful benevolent being who would not fashion us so as to be deceived even when using our minds properly. Having proved the existence of an all-powerful benevolent being qua creator of our minds, we can no longer entertain any doubts regarding our clear and distinct ideas even when we are not presently engaged in clear and distinct perceptions.

Descartes’ legitimation of clear and distinct perception via his proof of a benevolent God raises notorious interpretive challenges. Scholars disagree about how to resolve the problem of the “Cartesian circle.” However, there is general consensus that Descartes’ procedure is not, in fact, guilty of vicious, logical circularity. In order for Descartes’ procedure to avoid circularity, it is generally agreed that in some sense clear and distinct ideas need already to be legitimate before the proof of God’s existence. It is only in another sense that God’s existence legitimates their truth. Scholars disagree on how exactly to understand those different senses, but they generally agree that there is some sense at least in which clear and distinct ideas are self-legitimating, or, otherwise, not in need of legitimation.

That some ideas provide a basic standard of truth is a fundamental tenet of rationalism, and undergirds all the other rationalist principles at work in the construction of rationalist systems of philosophy. For the rationalists, if it cannot be taken for granted in at least some sense from the outset that the mind is capable of discerning the difference between truth and falsehood, then one never gets beyond skepticism.

b. Substance Metaphysics

The Continental rationalists deploy the principle of intelligibility and subordinate rational principles derived from it in generating much of the content of their respective philosophical systems. In no aspect of their systems is the application of rational principles to the generation of philosophical content more evident and more clearly illustrative of contrasting interpretations of these principles than in that for which the Continental rationalists are arguably best known: substance metaphysics.

i. Descartes

Descartes deploys his clear and distinct ideas doctrine in justifying his most well-known metaphysical position: substance dualism. The first step in Descartes’ demonstration of mind-body dualism, or, in his terminology, of a “real” distinction (that is, a distinction between two substances) between mind and body is to show that while it is possible to doubt that one has a body, it is not possible to doubt that one is thinking. As Descartes makes clear in the Principles of Philosophy, one of the chief upshots of his famous cogito argument is the discovery of the distinction between a thinking thing and a corporeal thing. The impossibility of doubting one’s existence is not the impossibility of doubting that one is a human being with a body with arms and legs and a head. It is the impossibility of doubting, rather, that one doubts, perceives, dreams, imagines, understands, wills, denies, and other modalities that Descartes attributes to the thinking thing. It is possible to think of oneself as a thing that thinks, and to recognize that it is impossible to doubt that one thinks, while continuing to doubt that one has a body with arms and legs and a head. So, the cogito drives a preliminary wedge between mind and body.

At this stage of the argument, however, Descartes has simply established that it is possible to conceive of himself as a thinking thing without conceiving of himself as a corporeal thing. It remains possible that, in fact, the thinking thing is identical with a corporeal thing, in other words, that thought is somehow something a body can do; Descartes has yet to establish that the epistemological distinction between his knowledge of his mind and his knowledge of body that results from the hyperbolic doubt translates to a metaphysical or ontological distinction between mind and body. The move from the epistemological distinction to the ontological distinction proceeds via the doctrine of clear and distinct ideas. Having established that whatever he clearly and distinctly perceives is true, Descartes is in a position to affirm the real distinction between mind and body.

In this life, it is never possible to clearly and distinctly perceive a mind actually separate from a body, at least in the case of finite, created minds, because minds and bodies are intimately unified in the composite human being. So Descartes cannot base his proof for the real distinction of mind and body on the clear and distinct perception that mind and body are in fact independently existing things. Rather, Descartes’ argument is based on the joint claims that (1) it is possible to have a clear and distinct idea of thought apart from extension and vice versa; and (2) whatever we can clearly and distinctly understand is capable of being created by God exactly as we clearly and distinctly understand it. Thus, the fact that we can clearly and distinctly understand thought apart from extension and vice versa entails that thinking things and extended things are “really” distinct (in the sense that they are distinct substances separable by God).

The foregoing argument relies on certain background assumptions which it is now necessary to explain, in particular, Descartes’ conception of substance. In the Principles, Descartes defines substance as “a thing which exists in such a way as to depend on no other thing for its existence” (CSM I, 210). Properly speaking, only God can be understood to depend on no other thing, and so only God is a substance in the absolute sense. Nevertheless, Descartes allows that, in a relative sense, created things can count as substances too. A created thing is a substance if the only thing it relies upon for its existence is “the ordinary concurrence of God” (ibid.). Only mind and body qualify as substances in this secondary sense. Everything else is a modification or property of minds and bodies. A second point is that, for Descartes, we do not have a direct knowledge of substance; rather, we come to know substance by virtue of its attributes. Thought and extension are the attributes or properties in virtue of which we come to know thinking and corporeal substance, or “mind” and “body.” This point relies on the application of a key rational principle, to wit, nothingness has no properties. For Descartes, there cannot simply be the properties of thinking and extension without these properties having something in which to inhere. Thinking and extension are not just any properties; Descartes calls them “principal attributes” because they constitute the nature of their respective substances. Other, non-essential properties, cannot be understood without the principal attribute, but the principal attribute can be understood without any of the non-essential properties. For example, motion cannot be understood without extension, but extension can be understood without motion.

Descartes’ conception of mind and body as distinct substances includes some interesting corollaries which result from a characteristic application of rational principles and account for some characteristic doctrinal differences between Descartes and empiricist philosophers. One consequence of Descartes’ conception of the mind as a substance whose principal attribute is thought is that the mind must always be thinking. Since, for Descartes, thinking is something of which the thinker is necessarily aware, Descartes’ commitment to thought as an essential, and therefore, inseparable, property of the mind raises some awkward difficulties. Arnauld, for example, raises one such difficulty in his Objections to Descartes’ Meditations: presumably there is much going on in the mind of an infant in its mother’s womb of which the infant is not aware. In response to this objection, and also in response to another obvious problem, that is, that of dreamless sleep, Descartes insists on a distinction between being aware of or conscious of our thoughts at the time we are thinking them, and remembering them afterwards (CSMK III, 357). The infant is, in fact, aware of its thinking in the mother’s womb, but it is aware only of very confused sensory thoughts of pain and pleasure and heat (not, as Descartes points out, metaphysical matters (CSMK III, 189)) which it does not remember afterwards. Similarly, the mind is always thinking even in the most “dreamless sleep,” it is just that the mind often immediately forgets much of what it had been aware.

Descartes’ commitment to embracing the implications – however counter-intuitive – of his substance-attribute metaphysics, puts him at odds with, for instance, Locke, who mocks the Cartesian doctrine of the always-thinking soul in his An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. For Locke, the question whether the soul is always thinking or not must be decided by experience and not, as Locke says, merely by “hypothesis” (An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Book II, Chapter 1). The evidence of dreamless sleep makes it obvious, for Locke, that the soul is not always thinking. Because Locke ties personal identity to memory, if the soul were to think while asleep without knowing it, the sleeping man and the waking man would be two different persons.

Descartes’ commitment to the always-thinking mind is a consequence of his commitment to a more basic rational principle. In establishing his conception of thinking substance, Descartes reasons from the attribute of thinking to the substance of thinking on the grounds that nothing has no properties. In this case, he reasons in the other direction, from the substance of thinking, that is, the mind, to the property of thinking on the converse grounds that something must have properties, and the properties it must have are the properties that make it what it is; in the case of the mind, that property is thought. (Leibniz found a way to maintain the integrity of the rational principle without contradicting experience: admit that thinking need not be conscious. This way the mind can still think in a dreamless sleep, and so avoid being without any properties, without any problem about the recollection of awareness.)

Another consequence of Descartes’ substance metaphysics concerns corporeal substance. For Descartes, we do not know corporeal substance directly, but rather through a grasp of its principal attribute, extension. Extension qua property requires a substance in which to inhere because of the rational principle, nothing has no properties. This rational principle leads to another characteristic Cartesian position regarding the material world: the denial of a vacuum. Descartes denies that space can be empty or void. Space has the property of being extended in length, breadth, and depth, and such properties require a substance in which to inhere. Thus, nothing, that is, a void or vacuum, is not able to have such properties because of the rational principle, nothing has no properties. This means that all space is filled with substance, even if it is imperceptible. Once again, Descartes answers a debated philosophical question on the basis of a rational principle.

ii. Spinoza

If Descartes is known for his dualism, Spinoza, of course, is known for monism – the doctrine that there is only one substance. Spinoza’s argument for substance monism (laid out in the first fifteen propositions of the Ethics) has no essential basis in sensory experience; it proceeds through rational argumentation and the deployment of rational principles; although Spinoza provides one a posteriori argument for God’s existence, he makes clear that he presents it only because it is easier to grasp than the a priori arguments, and not because it is in any way necessary.

The crucial step in the argument for substance monism comes in Ethics 1p5: “In Nature there cannot be two or more substances of the same nature or attribute.” It is at this proposition that Descartes (and Leibniz, and many others) would part ways with Spinoza. The most striking and controversial implication of this proposition, at least from a Cartesian perspective, is that human minds cannot qualify as substances, since human minds all share the same nature or attribute, that is, thought. In Spinoza’s philosophy, human minds are actually themselves properties – Spinoza calls them “modes” – of a more basic, infinite substance.

The argument for 1p5 works as follows. If there were two or more distinct substances, there would have to be some way to distinguish between them. There are two possible distinctions to be made: either by a difference in their affections or by a difference in their attributes. For Spinoza, a substance is something which exists in itself and can be conceived through itself; an attribute is “what the intellect perceives of a substance, as constituting its essence” (Ethics 1d4). Spinoza’s conception of attributes is a matter of longstanding scholarly debate, but for present purposes, we can think of it along Cartesian lines. For Descartes, substance is always grasped through a principal property, which is the nature or essence of the substance. Spinoza agrees that an attribute is that through which the mind conceives the nature or essence of substance. With this in mind, if a distinction between two substances were to be made on the basis of a difference in attributes, then there would not be two substances of the same attribute as the proposition indicates. This means that if there were two substances of the same attribute, it would be necessary to distinguish between them on the basis of a difference in modes or affections.

Spinoza conceives of an affection or mode as something which exists in another and needs to be conceived through another. Given this conception of affections, it is impossible, for Spinoza, to distinguish between two substances on the basis of a difference in affections. Doing so would be somewhat akin to affirming that there are two apples on the basis of a difference between two colors, when one apple can quite possibly have a red part and a green part. As color differences do not per se determine differences between apples, in a similar way, modal differences cannot determine a difference between substances – you could just be dealing with one substance bearing multiple different affections. It is notable that in 1p5, Spinoza uses virtually the same substance-attribute schema as Descartes to deny a fundamental feature of Descartes’ system.

Having established 1p5, the next major step in Spinoza’s argument for substance monism is to establish the necessary existence and infinity of substance. For Spinoza, if things have nothing in common with each other, one cannot be the cause of the other. This thesis depends upon assumptions that lie at the heart of Spinoza’s rationalism. Something that has nothing in common with another thing cannot be the cause of the other thing because things that have nothing in common with one another cannot be understood through one another (Ethics 1a5). But, for Spinoza, effects should be able to be understood through causes. Indeed, what it is to understand something, for Spinoza, is to understand its cause. The order of knowledge, provided that the knowledge is genuine, or, as Spinoza says, “adequate,” must map onto the order of being, and vice versa. Thus, Spinoza’s claim that if things have nothing in common with one another, one cannot be the cause of the other, is an expression of Spinoza’s fundamental, rationalist commitment to the intelligibility of the world. Given this assumption, and given the fact that no two substances have anything in common with one another, since no two substances share the same nature or attribute, it follows that if a substance is to exist, it must exist as causa sui (self-caused); in other words, it must pertain to the essence of substance to exist. Moreover, Spinoza thinks that since there is nothing that has anything in common with a given substance, there is therefore nothing to limit the nature of a given substance, and so every substance will necessarily be infinite. This assertion depends on another deep-seated assumption of Spinoza’s philosophy: nothing limits itself, but everything by virtue of its very nature affirms its own nature and existence as much as possible.

At this stage, Spinoza has argued that substances of a single attribute exist necessarily and are necessarily infinite. The last major stage of the argument for substance monism is the transition from multiple substances of a single attribute to only one substance of infinite attributes. Scholars have expressed varying degrees of satisfaction with the lucidity of this transition. It seems to work as follows. It is possible to attribute many attributes to one substance. The more reality or being each thing has, the more attributes belong to it. Therefore, an absolutely infinite being is a being that consists of infinite attributes. Spinoza calls an absolutely infinite being or substance consisting of infinite attributes “God.” Spinoza gives four distinct arguments for God’s existence in Ethics 1p11. The first is commonly interpreted as Spinoza’s version of an ontological argument. It refers back to 1p7 where Spinoza proved that it pertains to the essence of substance to exist. The second argument is relevant to present purposes, since it turns on Spinoza’s version of the principle of sufficient reason: “For each thing there must be assigned a cause, or reason, both for its existence and for its nonexistence” (Ethics 1p11dem). But there can be no reason for God’s nonexistence for the same reasons that all substances are necessarily infinite: there is nothing outside of God that is able to limit Him, and nothing limits itself. Once again, Spinoza’s argument rests upon his assumption that things by nature affirm their own existence. The third argument is a posteriori, and the fourth pivots like the second on the assumption that things by nature affirm their own existence.

Having proven that a being consisting of infinite attributes exists, Spinoza’s argument for substance monism is nearly complete. It remains only to point out that no substance besides God can exist, because if it did, it would have to share at least one of God’s infinite attributes, which, by 1p5, is impossible. Everything that exists, then, is either an attribute or an affection of God.

iii. Leibniz

Leibniz’s universe consists of an infinity of monads or simple substances, and God. For Leibniz, the universe must be composed of monads or simple substances. His justification for this claim is relatively straightforward. There must be simples, because there are compounds, and compounds are just collections of simples. To be simple, for Leibniz, means to be without parts, and thus to be indivisible. For Leibniz, the simples or monads are the “true atoms of nature” (L, 643). However, “material atoms are contrary to reason” (L, 456). Manifold a priori considerations lead Leibniz to reject material atoms. In the first place, the notion of a material atom is contradictory in Leibniz’s view. Matter is extended, and that which is extended is divisible into parts. The very notion of an atom, however, is the notion of something indivisible, lacking parts.

From a different perspective, Leibniz’s dynamical investigations provide another argument against material atoms. Absolute rigidity is included in the notion of a material atom, since any elasticity in the atom could only be accounted for on the basis of parts within the atom shifting their position with respect to each other, which is contrary to the notion of a partless atom. According to Leibniz’s analysis of impact, however, absolute rigidity is shown not to make sense. Consider the rebound of one atom as a result of its collision with another. If the atoms were absolutely rigid, the change in motion resulting from the collision would have to happen instantaneously, or, as Leibniz says, “through a leap or in a moment” (L, 446). The atom would change from initial motion to rest to rebounded motion without passing through any intermediary degrees of motion. Since the body must pass through all the intermediary degrees of motion in transitioning from one state of motion to another, it must not be absolutely rigid, but rather elastic; the analysis of the parts of the body must, in correlation with the degree of motion, proceed to infinity. Leibniz’s dynamical argument against material atoms turns on what he calls the law of continuity, an a priori principle according to which “no change occurs through a leap.”

The true unities, or true atoms of nature, therefore, cannot be material; they must be spiritual or metaphysical substances akin to souls. Since Leibniz’s spiritual substances, or monads, are absolutely simple, without parts, they admit neither of dissolution nor composition. Moreover, there can be no interaction between monads, monads cannot receive impressions or undergo alterations by means of being affected from the outside, since, in Leibniz’s famous phrase from the Monadology, monads “have no windows” (L, 643). Monads must, however, have qualities, otherwise there would be no way to explain the changes we see in things and the diversity of nature. Indeed, following from Leibniz’s principle of the identity of indiscernibles, no two monads can be exactly alike, since each monad stands in a unique relation to the rest, and, for Leibniz, each monad’s relation to the rest is a distinctive feature of its nature. The way in which, for Leibniz, monads can have qualities while remaining simple, or in other words, the only way there can be multitude in simplicity is if monads are characterized and distinguished by means of their perceptions. Leibniz’s universe, in summary, consists in monads, simple spiritual substances, characterized and distinguished from one another by a unique series of perceptions determined by each monad’s unique relationship vis-à-vis the others.

Of the great rationalists, Leibniz is the most explicit about the principles of reasoning that govern his thought. Leibniz singles out two, in particular, as the most fundamental rational principles of his philosophy: the principle of contradiction and the principle of sufficient reason. According to the principle of contradiction, whatever involves a contradiction is false. According to the principle of sufficient reason, there is no fact or true proposition “without there being a sufficient reason for its being so and not otherwise” (L, 646). Corresponding to these two principles of reasoning are two kinds of truths: truths of reasoning and truths of fact. For Leibniz, truths of reasoning are necessary, and their opposite is impossible. Truths of fact, by contrast, are contingent, and their opposite is possible. Truths of reasoning are by most commentators associated with the principle of contradiction because they can be reduced via analysis to a relation between two primitive ideas, whose identity is intuitively evident. Thus, it is possible to grasp why it is impossible for truths of reasoning to be otherwise. However, this kind of resolution is only possible in the case of abstract propositions, such as the propositions of mathematics (see Section 3, c, above). Contingent truths, or truths of fact, by contrast, such as “Caesar crossed the Rubicon,” to use the example Leibniz gives in the Discourse on Metaphysics, are infinitely complicated. Although, for Leibniz, every predicate is contained in its subject, to reduce the relationship between Caesar’s “notion” and his action of crossing the Rubicon would require an infinite analysis impossible for finite minds. “Caesar crossed the Rubicon” is a contingent proposition, because there is another possible world in which Caesar did not cross the Rubicon. To understand the reason for Caesar’s crossing, then, entails understanding why this world exists rather than any other possible world. It is for this reason that contingent truths are associated with the principle of sufficient reason. Although the opposite of truths of fact is possible, there is nevertheless a sufficient reason why the fact is so and not otherwise, even though this reason cannot be known by finite minds.

Truths of fact, then, need to be explained; there must be a sufficient reason for them. However, according to Leibniz, “a sufficient reason for existence cannot be found merely in any one individual thing or even in the whole aggregate and series of things” (L, 486). That is to say, the sufficient reason for any given contingent fact cannot be found within the world of which it is a part. The sufficient reason must explain why this world exists rather than another possible world, and this reason must lie outside the world itself. For Leibniz, the ultimate reason for things must be contained in a necessary substance that creates the world, that is, God. But if the existence of God is to ground the series of contingent facts that make up the world, there must be a sufficient reason why God created this world rather than any of the other infinite possible worlds contained in his understanding. As a perfect being, God would only have chosen to bring this world into existence rather than any other because it is the best of all possible worlds. God’s choice, therefore, is governed by the principle of fitness, or what Leibniz also calls the “principle of the best” (L, 647). The best world, according to Leibniz, is the one which maximizes perfection; and the most perfect world is the one which balances the greatest possible variety with the greatest possible order. God achieves maximal perfection in the world through what Leibniz calls “the pre-established harmony.” Although the world is made up of an infinity of monads with no direct interaction with one another, God harmonizes the perceptions of each monad with the perceptions of every other monad, such that each monad represents a unique perspective on the rest of the universe according to its position vis-à-vis the others.

According to Leibniz’s philosophy, in the case of all true propositions, the predicate is contained in the subject. This is often known as the “predicate-in-notion principle. The relationship between predicate and subject can only be reduced to an identity relation in the case of truths of reason, whereas in the case of truths of fact, the reduction requires an infinite analysis. Nevertheless, in both cases, it is possible in principle (which is to say, for an infinite intellect) to know everything that will ever happen to an individual substance, and even everything that will happen in the world of an individual substance on the basis of an examination of the individual substance’s notion, since each substance is an expression of the entire world. Leibniz’s predicate-in-notion principle therefore unifies both of his two great principles of reasoning – the principle of contradiction and the principle of sufficient reason – since the relation between predicate and subject is either such that it is impossible for it to be otherwise or such that there is a sufficient reason why it is as it is and not otherwise. Moreover, it represents a particularly robust expression of the principle of intelligibility at the very heart of Leibniz’s system. There is a reason why everything is as it is, whether that reason is subject to finite or only to infinite analysis.

(See also: 17th Century Theories of Substance.)

5. Continental Rationalism, Experience, and Experiment

Rationalism is often criticized for placing too much confidence in the ability of reason alone to know the world. The extent to which one finds this criticism justified depends largely on one’s view of reason. For Hume, for instance, knowledge of the world of “matters of fact” is gained exclusively through experience; reason is merely a faculty for comparing ideas gained through experience; it is thus parasitic upon experience, and has no claim whatsoever to grasp anything about the world itself, let alone any special claim. For Kant, reason is a mental faculty with an inherent tendency to transgress the bounds of possible experience in an effort to grasp the metaphysical foundations of the phenomenal realm. Since knowledge of the world is limited to objects of possible experience, for Kant, reason, with its delusions of grasping reality beyond those limits, must be subject to critique.

Sometimes rationalism is charged with neglecting or undervaluing experience, and with embarrassingly having no means of accounting for the tremendous success of the experimental sciences. While the criticism of the confidence placed in reason may be defensible given a certain conception of reason (which may or may not itself be ultimately defensible), the latter charge of neglecting experience is not; more often than not it is the product of a false caricature of rationalism

Descartes and Leibniz were the leading mathematicians of their day, and stood at the forefront of science. While Spinoza distinguished himself more as a political thinker, and as an interpreter of scripture (albeit a notorious one) than as a mathematician, Spinoza too performed experiments, kept abreast of the leading science of the day, and was renowned as an expert craftsman of lenses. Far from neglecting experience, the great rationalists had, in general, a sophisticated understanding of the role of experience and, indeed, of experiment, in the acquisition and development of knowledge. The fact that the rationalists held that experience and experiment cannot serve as foundations for knowledge, but must be fitted within, and interpreted in light of, a rational epistemic framework, should not be confused with a neglect of experience and experiment.

a. Descartes

One of the stated purposes of Descartes’ Meditations, and, in particular, the hyperbolic doubts with which it commences, is to reveal to the mind of the reader the limitations of its reliance on the senses, which Descartes regards as an inadequate foundation for knowledge. By leading the mind away from the senses, which often deceive, and which yield only confused ideas, Descartes prepares the reader to discover the clear and distinct perceptions of the pure intellect, which provide a proper foundation for genuine knowledge. Nevertheless, empirical observations and experimentation clearly had an important role to play in Descartes’ natural philosophy, as evidenced by his own private empirical and experimental research, especially in optics and anatomy, and by his explicit statements in several writings on the role and importance of observation and experiment.

In Part 6 of the Discourse on the Method, Descartes makes an open plea for assistance – both financial and otherwise – in making systematic empirical observations and conducting experiments. Also in Discourse Part 6, Descartes lays out his program for developing knowledge of nature. It begins with the discovery of “certain seeds of truth” implanted naturally in our souls (CSM I, 144). From them, Descartes seeks to derive the first principles and causes of everything. Descartes’ Meditations illustrates these first stages of the program. By “seeds of truth” Descartes has in mind certain intuitions, including the ideas of thinking, and extension, and, in particular, of God. On the basis of clearly and distinctly perceiving the distinction between what belongs properly to extension (figure, position, motion) and what does not (colors, sounds, smells, and so forth), Descartes discovers the principles of physics, including the laws of motion. From these principles, it is possible to deduce many particular ways in which the details of the world might be, only a small fraction of which represent the way the world actually is. It is as a result of the distance, as it were, between physical principles and laws of nature, on one hand, and the particular details of the world, on the other, that, for Descartes, observations and experiments become necessary.

Descartes is ambivalent about the relationship between physical principles and particulars, and about the role that observation and experiment play in mediating this relationship. On the one hand, Descartes expresses commitment to the ideal of a science deduced with certainty from intuitively grasped first principles. Because of the great variety of mutually incompatible consequences that can be derived from physical principles, observation and experiment are required even in the ideal deductive science to discriminate between actual consequences and merely possible ones. According to the ideal of deductive science, however, observation and experiment should be used only to facilitate the deduction of effects from first causes, and not as a basis for an inference to possible explanations of natural phenomena, as Descartes makes clear at one point his Principles of Philosophy (CSM I, 249). If the explanations were only possible, or hypothetical, the science could not lay claim to certainty per the deductive ideal, but merely to probability.

On the other hand, Descartes states explicitly at another point in the Principles of Philosophy that the explanations provided of such phenomena as the motion of celestial bodies and the nature of the earth’s elements should be regarded merely as hypotheses arrived at on the basis of a posteriori reasoning (CSM I, 255); while Descartes says that such hypotheses must agree with observation and facilitate predictions, they need not in fact reflect the actual causes of phenomena. Descartes appears to concede, albeit reluctantly, that when it comes to explaining particular phenomena, hypothetical explanations and moral certainty (that is, mere probability) are all that can be hoped for.

Scholars have offered a range of explanations for the inconsistency in Descartes’ writings on the question of the relation between first principles and particulars. It has been suggested that the inconsistency within the Principles of Philosophy reflects different stages of its composition (see Garber 1978). However the inconsistency might be explained, it is clear that Descartes did not take it for granted that the ideal of a deductive science of nature could be realized. Moreover, whether or not Descartes ultimately believed the ideal of deductive science was realizable, he was unambiguous on the importance of observation and experiment in bridging the distance between physical principles and particular phenomena. (For further discussion, see René Descartes: Scientific Method.)

b. Spinoza

The one work that Spinoza published under his own name in his lifetime was his geometrical reworking of Descartes’ Principles of Philosophy. In Spinoza’s presentation of the opening sections of Part 3 of Descartes’ Principles, Spinoza puts a strong emphasis on the hypothetical nature of the explanations of natural phenomena in Part 3. Given the hesitance and ambivalence with which Descartes concedes the hypothetical nature of his explanations in his Principles, Spinoza’s unequivocal insistence on hypotheses is striking. Elsewhere Spinoza endorses hypotheses more directly. In the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, Spinoza describes forming the concept of a sphere by affirming the rotation of a semicircle in thought. He points out that this idea is a true idea of a sphere even if no sphere has ever been produced this way in nature (The Collected Works of Spinoza, Vol. 1, p. 32). Spinoza’s view of hypotheses relates to his conception of good definitions (see Section 3, b, above). If the cause through which one conceives something allows for the deduction of all possible effects, then the cause is an adequate one, and there is no need to fear a false hypothesis. Spinoza appears to differ from Descartes in thinking that the formation of hypotheses, if done properly, is consistent with deductive certainty, and not tantamount to mere probability or moral certainty.

Again in the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, Spinoza speaks in Baconian fashion of identifying “aids” that can assist in the use of the senses and in conducting orderly experiments. Unfortunately, Spinoza’s comments regarding “aids” are very unclear. This is perhaps explained by the fact that they appear in a work that Spinoza never finished. Nevertheless, it does seem clear that although Spinoza, like Descartes, emphasized the importance of discovering proper principles from which to deduce knowledge of everything else, he was no less aware than Descartes of the need to proceed via observation and experiment in descending from such principles to particulars. At the same time, given his analysis of the inadequacy of sensory images, the collection of empirical data must be governed by rules and rational guidelines the details of which it does not seem that Spinoza ever worked out.

A valuable perspective on Spinoza’s attitude toward experimentation is provided by Letter 6, which Spinoza wrote to Oldenburg with comments on Robert Boyle’s experimental research. Among other matters, at issue is Boyle’s “redintegration” (or reconstitution) of niter (potassium nitrate). By heating niter with a burning coal, Boyle separated the niter into a “fixed” part and a volatile part; he then proceeded to distill the volatile part, and recombine it with the fixed part, thereby redintegrating the niter. Boyle’s aim was to show that the nature of niter is not determined by a Scholastic “substantial form,” but rather by the composition of parts, whose secondary qualities (color, taste, smell, and so forth) are determined by primary qualities (size, position, motion, and so forth). While taking no issue with Boyle’s attempt to undermine the Scholastic analysis of physical natures, Spinoza criticized Boyle’s interpretation of the experiment, arguing that the fixed niter was merely an impurity left over, and that there was no difference between the niter and the volatile part other than a difference of state.

Two things stand out from Spinoza’s comments on Boyle. On the one hand, Spinoza exhibits a degree of impatience with Boyle’s experiments, charging some of them with superfluity on the grounds either that what they show is evident on the basis of reason alone, or that previous philosophers have already sufficiently demonstrated them experimentally. In addition, Spinoza’s own interpretation of Boyle’s experiment is primarily based in a rather speculative, Cartesian account of the mechanical constitution of niter (as Boyle himself points out in response to Spinoza). On the other hand, Spinoza appears eager to show his own fluency with experimental practice, describing no fewer than three different experiments of his own invention to support his interpretation of the redintegration. What Spinoza is critical of is not so much Boyle’s use of experiment per se as his relative neglect of relevant rational considerations. For instance, Spinoza at one point criticizes Boyle for trying to show that secondary qualities depend on primary qualities on experimental grounds. Spinoza thought the proposition needed to be demonstrated on rational grounds.  While Spinoza acknowledges the importance and necessity of observation and experiment, his emphasis and focus is on the rational framework needed for making sense of experimental findings, without which the results are confused and misleading.

c. Leibniz

In principle, Leibniz thinks it is not impossible to discover the interior constitution of bodies a priori on the basis of a knowledge of God and the “principle of the best” according to which He creates the world. Leibniz sometimes remarks that angels could explain to us the intelligible causes through which all things come about, but he seems conflicted over whether such understanding is actually possible for human beings. Leibniz seems to think that while the a priori pathway should be pursued in this life by the brightest minds in any case, its perfection will only be possible in the afterlife. The obstacle to an a priori conception of things is the complexity of sensible effects. In this life, then, knowledge of nature cannot be purely a priori, but depends on observation and experimentation in conjunction with reason

Apart from perception, we have clear and distinct ideas only of magnitude, figure, motion, and other such quantifiable attributes (primary qualities). The goal of all empirical research must be to resolve phenomena (including secondary qualities) into such distinctly perceived, quantifiable notions. For example, heat is explained in terms of some particular motion of air or some other fluid. Only in this way can the epistemic ideal be achieved of understanding how phenomena follow from their causes in the same way that we know how the hammer stroke after a period of time follows from the workings of a clock (L, 173). To this end, experiments must be carried out to indicate possible relationships between secondary qualities and primary qualities, and to provide a basis for the formulation of hypotheses to explain the phenomena.

Nevertheless, there is an inherent limitation to this procedure. Leibniz explains that if there were people who had no direct experience of heat, for instance, even if someone were to explain to them the precise mechanical cause of heat, they would still not be able to know the sensation of heat, because they would still not distinctly grasp the connection between bodily motion and perception (L, 285). Leibniz seems to think that human beings will never be able to bridge the explanatory gap between sensations and mechanical causes. There will always be an irreducibly confused aspect of sensible ideas, even if they can be associated with a high degree of sophistication with distinctly perceivable, quantifiable notions. However, this limitation does not mean, for Leibniz, that there is any futility in human efforts to understand the world scientifically. In the first place, experimental knowledge of the composition of things is tremendously useful in practice, even if the composition is not distinctly perceived in all its parts. As Leibniz points out, the architect who uses stones to erect a cathedral need not possess a distinct knowledge of the bits of earth interposed between the stones (L, 175). Secondly, even if our understanding of the causes of sensible effects must remain forever hypothetical, the hypotheses themselves can be more or less refined, and it is proper experimentation that assists in their refinement.

6. References and Further Reading

When citing the works of Descartes, the three volume English translation by Cottingham, Stoothoff, Murdoch, and Kenny was used. For the original language, the edition by Adam and Tannery was consulted.

When citing Spinoza’s Ethics, the translation by Curley in A Spinoza Reader was used. The following system of abbreviation was used when citing passages from the Ethics: the first number designates the part of the Ethics (1-5); then, “p” is for proposition, “d” for definition, “a” for axiom, “dem” for demonstration, “c” for corollary, and “s” for scholium. So, 1p17s refers to the scholium of the seventeenth proposition of the first part of the Ethics. For the original language, the edition by Gebhardt was consulted.

For the original language in Leibniz, the edition by Gerhardt was consulted.

a. Primary Sources

  • Bacon, Francis. The Works of Francis Bacon. 7 Volumes. Edited by J. Spedding, R. L. Ellis, and D.D. Heath. London: Longmans, 1857-70. Cited above as Spedding, volume, page.
  • Bacon, Francis. The New Organon. Edited by Lisa Jardine and Michael Silverthorne. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Descartes, René. Oeuvres de Descartes. 12 Volumes. Edited by C. Adam and P. Tannery. Paris: J. Vrin, 1964-76.
  • Descartes, René. The Philosophical Writings of Descartes. 3 vols. Vols. 1 and 2 translated by John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, and Dugald Murdoch. Vol. 3 translated by John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugald Murdoch, and Anthony Kenny. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1984-91. Cited above as CSM or CSMK, volume, page.
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  • Leibniz, G.W. New Essays on Human Understanding. Translated and edited by Peter Remnant and Jonathan Bennett. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1996. Cited above as NE, page.
  • Locke, John. An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Edited by Peter H. Nidditch. Oxford, UK: Oxford University Press, 1979.
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  • Spinoza, Benedict de. Spinoza Opera. 4 Volumes. Edited by C. Gebhardt. Heidelberg: Carl Winter, 1925.
  • Spinoza, Benedict de. The Collected Works of Spinoza. Vol. 1. Edited and translated by Edwin Curley. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1985.
  • Spinoza, Benedict de. A Spinoza Reader: The Ethics and Other Works. Edited and translated by Edwin Curley. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1994.
  • Spinoza, Benedict de. Spinoza: Complete Works. Translated by Samuel Shirley and edited by Michael L. Morgan. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 2002.

b. Secondary Sources

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  • Biasutti, Franco. “Reason and Experience in Leibniz and Spinoza” in Studia Spinozana, Volume 6, Spinoza and Leibniz (1990): 45-71.
  • Cottingham, John. The Rationalists. Oxford, UK: Oxford University Press, 1988.
  • Della Rocca, Michael. Spinoza. London: Routledge, 2008.
  • Fraenkel, Carlos; Perinetti, Dario; Smith, Justin E.H. (eds.). The Rationalists: Between Tradition and Innovation. Dordrecht: Springer, 2011.
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Author Information

Matthew Homan
Christopher Newport University
U. S. A.